Category Archives: Philosophers

Anaxagoras (c. 500—428 B.C.E.)

AnaxagorasAnaxagoras of Clazomenae was an important Presocratic natural philosopher and scientist who lived and taught in Athens for approximately thirty years. He gained notoriety for his materialistic views, particularly his contention that the sun was a fiery rock. This led to charges of impiety, and he was sentenced to death by the Athenian court. He avoided this penalty by leaving Athens, and he spent his remaining years in exile. While Anaxagoras proposed theories on a variety of subjects, he is most noted for two theories. First, he speculated that in the physical world everything contains a portion of everything else. His observation of how nutrition works in animals led him to conclude that in order for the food an animal eats to turn into bone, hair, flesh, and so forth, it must already contain all of those constituents within it. The second theory of significance is Anaxagoras’ postulation of Mind (Nous) as the initiating and governing principle of the cosmos.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Writing
  2. The Structure of Things: A Portion of Everything in Everything
    1. The Challenge of Parmenides
    2. Empedocles’s Theory
    3. The Lesson of Nutrition
    4. The Divisibility of “Stuffs”
    5. Why is Something What It Is?
  3. The Origins of the Cosmos
  4. Mind (nous)
    1. The Role of Mind
    2. The Nature of Mind
  5. Other Theories
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Writing

The exact chronology of Anaxagoras is unknown, but most accounts place his dates around 500-428 BCE. Some have argued for dates of c. 534-467 BCE, but the 500-428 time period is the most commonly accepted among scholars. Anaxagoras was born in Ionia in the town of Clazomenae, a lively port city on the coast of present-day Turkey. As such, he is considered to be both the geographical and theoretical successor to the earliest Ionian philosophers, particularly Anaximenes. Eventually, Anaxagoras made his way to Athens and he is often credited with making her the home of Western philosophical and physical speculation. Anaxagoras remained in Athens for some thirty years, according to most accounts, until he was indicted on the charge of impiety and sentenced to death. Rather than endure this penalty, Anaxagoras, with the help of his close friend and student, Pericles, went to Lampsacus, in Asia Minor, where he lived until his death.

Anaxagoras’ trial and sentencing in Athens were motivated by a combination of political and religious concerns. His close association with Pericles left him vulnerable to those who wished to discredit the powerful and controversial student through the teacher. Furthermore, his materialistic beliefs and teachings were quite contrary to the standard orthodoxy of the time, particularly his view that the heavenly bodies were fiery masses of rock whirling around the earth in ether. Such convictions are famously attested to inPlato’s Apology when Socrates, accused by Meletus of believing that the sun is stone and the moon is earth, distances himself from such atheistic notions:

My dear Meletus, do you think you are prosecuting Anaxagoras? Are you so contemptuous of the jury and think them so ignorant of letters as not to know that the books of Anaxagoras of Clazomenae are full of those theories, and further, that the young men learn from me what they can buy from time to time for a drachma, at most, in the bookshops, and ridicule Socrates if he pretends that these theories are his own, especially as they are so absurd? (26d)

As with the dates of his birth and death, the chronology of Anaxagoras’ exile and subsequent time in Lampsacus are a bit of a mystery. Some of the historical testimonies indicate that his trial occurred shortly before the Peloponnesian War, around 431 BCE. If this is the case, then Anaxagoras’ time in exile would have lasted no more than a few years. Other records indicate that his trial and exile occurred much earlier, and his time in Lampsacus enabled him to start an influential school where he taught for nearly twenty years. With regard to the persona of Anaxagoras, there are quite a few interesting anecdotes that paint a picture of an ivory tower scientist and philosopher who was extremely detached from the general concerns and practical matters of life. While the stories are possibly fanciful, the consistent image of Anaxagoras presented throughout antiquity is that of a person entirely consumed by the pursuit of knowledge. In fact, he apparently maintained that the opportunity to study the universe was the fundamental reason why it is better to be born than to not exist.

In his Lives of the PhilosophersDiogenes Laertius states that Anaxagoras is among those philosophers who wrote only one book. This work was a treatise on natural philosophy and, as the above quote from the Apology indicates, it was probably not a very long work, since it could be purchased for “a drachma, at most.” Although the book has not survived, it was available until at least the sixth-century CE. While it is impossible to recreate the entire content and order of his work, various ancient sources have provided scholars with enough information to fairly represent Anaxagoras’ philosophy. Noteworthy among these sources are AristotleTheophrastus (ca. 372-288 BCE) and Themistius (ca. 317-387 CE). We are primarily indebted, however, to Simplicius (sixth-century CE) for most of our knowledge of, and access to, the fragments of Anaxagoras’ work. Before moving on to the theories of Anaxagoras, it should be noted that there are some rather wide ranging disagreements among scholars today about some of the basic tenets of his philosophy. In fact, within the past twenty years or so, there have been a greater variety of interpretations of Anaxagoras than perhaps any other Presocratic philosopher.

2. The Structure of Things: A Portion of Everything in Everything

Anaxagoras’ innovative theory of physical nature is encapsulated in the phrase, “a portion of everything in everything.” Its primary expression is found in the following difficult fragment:

And since the portions of both the large and the small are equal in amount, in this way too all things would be in everything; nor can they be separate, but all things have a portion of everything. Since there cannot be a smallest, nothing can be separated or come to be by itself, but as in the beginning now too all things are together. But in all things there are many things, equal in amount, both in the larger and the smaller of the things being separated off. (frag. 6)

It should be pointed out that it is rather difficult to determine what exactly Anaxagoras meant by “things.” It is tempting to view this as a theory of matter, but this would be misguided as it tends to apply later Aristotelian categories and interpretations onto Anaxagoras. At times, the term “seeds” has been utilized but it would seem that many scholars today prefer the neutral term “stuffs” to depict this notion. In any case, this rather complex theory is best understood as Anaxagoras’ attempt to reconcile his perceptions of the world with an influential argument (presented some time earlier by Parmenides) about how reality must be conceived.

a. The Challenge of Parmenides

According to Parmenides, whatever is, is (being) and whatever is not, is not (nonbeing). As a result, whatever constitutes the nature of reality must always “have been” since nothing can come into being from nothing. Furthermore, reality must always “be” since being (what is) cannot become nonbeing (what is not). This argument led Parmenides to a monistic and static conception of reality. As such, the world of changing particulars is deceptive, despite appearances to the contrary. Anaxagoras appears to accept this argument of Parmenides as the following statement indicates: “The Greeks are wrong to accept coming to be and perishing, for no thing comes to be, nor does it perish.” (frag. 17) Anaxagoras could not, however, square the thesis of radical monism with his experience of a world that seems to admit plurality and change. In fact, if all of the theses of Parmenides are correct, there is no possibility of science because all empirically gathered data is misleading. Therefore, the challenge for Anaxagoras and other post-Parmenidian philosophers was to present a proper account of nature while maintaining the demand that the stuff that constitutes reality can neither come into being from nothing nor pass away into nonbeing.

b. Empedocles’s Theory

Empedocles was a contemporary of Anaxagoras and, while the historical records are inconclusive, it is possible that the latter was partially reacting to the theory of the former in the development of his own views. In response to Parmenides, Empedocles maintained that the four elements—earth, air, fire, water—were the constituents or “roots” of all matter. These four roots cannot come into being, be destroyed or admit any change. Therefore, apart from the fact that there are four, they are essentially identical to the “one” of Parmenides. The roots mix together in various proportions to account for all the things in the world that we suppose to be real, such as apples, horses, etc. As an apple dissolves, it does not collapse into nonbeing, rather the mixture that has accounted for the apparent apple of our senses has simply been rearranged. Apples, and other “mortal things,” as Empedocles called them, do not actually come to be, nor are they actually destroyed. This is simply the way humans like to talk about entities which appear to exist but do not.

Anaxagoras’ relationship to Empedocles is difficult to discern, but it is possible that he was not satisfied with Empedocles’ response to Parmenides and the Eliatics. On Aristotle’s interpretation, Anaxagoras maintained that the pluralism of Empedocles unduly singled out certain substances as primary and others as secondary. According to Anaxagoras, the testimony of our senses maintains that hair or flesh exist as assuredly as earth, air, water or fire. In fact, all of the infinite numbers of substances are as real as the root substances. Therefore, under this interpretation the key problem for Anaxagoras is that under Empodocles' theory it would be possible to divide a hair into smaller and smaller pieces until it was no longer hair, but a composite of the root substances. As such, this would no longer satisfy the requirement that a definite substance cannot pass into nonbeing. According to other interpretations, however, some of the textual evidence from Anaxagoras seems to suggest that he treated some “things” (ala Empedocles) as more basic and primary than others. In any case, the theoretical distinctions between the two philosophers are somewhat unclear. Despite these difficulties, it is clear that Anaxagoras proposes a theory of things that is distinct from Empedocles while encountering the challenges of Parmenides.

c. The Lesson of Nutrition

While there is some recent scholarly debate about this, Anaxagoras’ contention that all things have a portion of everything may have had its genesis in the phenomenon of nutrition. He observed among animals that the food that is used to nourish develops into flesh, hair, etc. For this to be the case, Anaxagoras believed that rice, for instance, must contain within it the substances hair and flesh. Again, this is in keeping with the notion that definite substances cannot arise from nothing: “For how can hair come to be from not hair or flesh from not flesh?” (frag. 10). Moreover, not only does a piece of rice contain hair and flesh, it in fact contains the entirety of all the infinite amount of stuffs (a portion of everything). But how is this possible?

d. The Divisibility of “Stuffs”

To understand how it is possible for there to be a portion of everything in everything, it is necessary to develop Anaxagoras’ contention that stuff is infinitely divisible. In practical terms, this can be explained by continuing with the example of the rice kernel. For Anaxagoras, if one were to begin dividing it into smaller and smaller portions there would be no point at which the rice would no longer exist. Each infinitesimally small piece could be divided into another, and each piece would continue to contain rice, as well as hair, flesh and a portion of everything else. Prior to Anaxagoras, Zeno, a disciple of Parmenides, argued against the notion that matter could be divided at all, let alone infinitely. Apparently, Zeno had about forty reductio ad absurdum attacks on pluralism, four of which are known to us. For our purposes, it is not necessary to delve into these arguments, but a key assumption that arises from Zeno is the contention that a plurality of things would make the notion of magnitude meaningless. For Zeno, if an infinite division of things were possible then the following paradox would arise. The divisions would conceivably be so small that they would have no magnitude at all. At the same time, things would have to be considered infinitely large in order to be able to be infinitely divided. While the scholarly evidence is not conclusive, it seems quite possible that Anaxagoras was replying to Zeno as he developed his notion of infinite divisibility.

As the following fragment indicates, Anaxagoras did not consider the consequence that Zeno presented to be problematic: “For of the small there is no smallest, but always a smaller (for what is cannot not be). But also of the large there is always a larger, and it is equal in amount to the small. But in relation to itself, each is both large and small” (frag. 3). According to some interpreters, what is remarkable about this fragment, and others similar to it, is that it indicates the extent to which Anaxagoras grasped the notion of infinity. As W.K.C. Guthrie points out, “Anaxagoras’ reply shows an understanding of the meaning of infinity which no Greek before him had attained: things are indeed infinite in quantity and at the same time infinitely small, but they can go on becoming smaller to infinity without thereby becoming mere points without magnitude” (289). Other interpretations are somewhat less charitable toward Anaxagoras’ grasp of infinity, however, and point out that he may not have been conceptualizing about the notion of mathematical infinity when speaking about divisibility.

In any case, as strange as it may appear to modern eyes, Anaxagoras’ unique and subtle theory accomplished what it set out to do. It satisfied the Parmenidian demand that nothing can come into or out of being and it accounted for the plurality and change that constitutes our world of experience. A difficult question remains for Anaxagoras’ theory, however.

e. Why is Something What It Is?

If, according to Anaxagoras, everything contains a portion of everything, then what makes something (rice, for instance) what it is? Anaxagoras does not provide a clear response to this question, but an answer is alluded to in his claim that “each single thing is and was most plainly those things of which it contains most.” (frag. 12) Presumably, this can be taken to mean that each constituent of matter also has a part of matter that is predominant in it. Commentators from Aristotle onward have struggled to make sense of this notion, but it is perhaps Guthrie’s interpretation that is most helpful: “Everything contains a portion of everything else, and a large piece of something contains as many portions as a small piece of it, though they differ in size; but every substance does not contain all the infinite number of substances in equal proportions” (291). As such, a substance like rice, while containing everything, contains a higher proportion of white, hardness, etc. than a substance like wood. Simply stated, rice contains more stuff that makes it rice than wood or any other substance. Presumably, rice also contains higher proportions of flesh and hair than wood does. This would explain why, from Anaxagoras’ perspective, an animal can become nourished by rice by not by wood.

Anaxagoras’ theory of nature is quite innovative and complex, but unfortunately his fragments do not provide us with very many details as to how things work on a micro level. He does, however, provide us with a macro level explanation for the origins of the world as we experience it. It is to his cosmogony that we now turn our attention.

3. The Origins of the Cosmos

Anaxagoras’ theory of the origins of the world is reminiscent of the cosmogonies that had been previously developed in the Ionion tradition, particularly through Anaximenes and Anaximander. The traditional theories generally depict an original unity which begins to become separated off into a series of opposites. Anaxagoras maintained many of the key elements of these theories, however he also updated these cosmogonies, most notably through the introduction of a causal agent (Mind or nous) that is the initiator of the origination process.

Prior to the beginning of world as we know it everything was combined together in such a unified manner that there were no qualities or individual substances that could be discerned. “All things were together, unlimited in both amount and smallness.” (frag. 1) As such, reality was like the Parmenidian whole, except this whole contained all the primary matters or “seeds,” which are represented in the following passages through a series of opposites:

But before these things separated off, when [or, since] all things were together, not even any color was manifest, for the mixture of all things prevented it—the wet and the dry, the hot and the cold, the bright and the dark, there being also much earth in the mixture and seeds unlimited in amount, in no way like one another. For none of the other things are alike either, the one to the other. Since this is so, it is necessary to suppose that all things were in the whole. (frag. 4b) The things in the single cosmos are not separate from one another, nor are they split apart with an axe, either the hot from the cold or the cold from the hot (frag. 8).

At some point, the unity is spurred into a vortex motion at a force and a speed “of nothing now found among humans, but altogether many times as fast” (frag. 9). This motion begins the separation and it is “air and aither” that are the first constituents of matter to become distinct. Again, this is not to be seen in Empedoclean terms to indicate that air and ether are primary elements They are simply a part of the infinite constituents of matter represented by the phrase “mixture and seeds.” As the air and ether became separated off, all other elements become manifest in this mixture as well: “From these things as they are being separated off, earth is being compounded; for water is being separated off out of the clouds, earth out of water, and out of the earthy stones are being compounded by the cold, and these [i.e., stones] move further out than the water” (frag. 16).

Therefore, the origin of the world is depicted through this process of motion and separation from the unified mixture. As mentioned above, in answering the “how” of cosmogony, Anaxagoras is fairly traditional in his theory. In proposing an initiator or causal explanation for the origins of the process, however, Anaxagoras separates himself from his predecessors.

4. Mind (nous)

a. The Role of Mind

According to Anaxagoras, the agent responsible for the rotation and separation of the primordial mixture is Mind or nous: “And when Mind began to cause motion, separating off proceeded to occur from all that was moved, and all that Mind moved was separated apart, and as things were being moved and separated apart, the rotation caused much more separating apart to occur” (fr. 13). As is previously mentioned, it is rather significant that Anaxagoras postulates an explanation for the movement of the cosmos, something that prior cosmogonies did not provide. But how is this explanation to be understood? From the passage above, one may infer that Mind serves simply as the initial cause for the motion, and once the rotation is occurring, the momentum sets everything else into place. In this instance it is tempting to assign a rather deistic function to Mind. In other passages, however, Mind is depicted as “ruling” the rotation and setting everything in order as well as having supreme power and knowledge of all things (see fr. 12 and Simplicius’ Commentary on Aristotle’s Physics, 495.20). In this case it is tempting to characterize Mind in theistic terms. Both of these temptations should be avoided, for Anaxagoras remained fully naturalistic in his philosophy. In fact, the uniqueness of Anaxagoras is that he proposed a rationalistic governing principle that remained free from the mythical or theological characteristics of prior cosmogonies. His philosophical successors, particularly Socrates, Plato and Aristotle, are very excited to find in Anaxagoras a unifying cosmic principle which does not allude to the whims of the gods. They hope to find in him an extension of this principle into a purpose-driven explanation for the universe. Alas, they are all disappointed that Anaxagoras makes no attempt to develop his theory of Mind in such a way.

What Socrates, Plato and Aristotle were hoping to discover in Anaxagoras was not simply an account of how the cosmos originated (an efficient cause), but an explanation for why and for what purpose the cosmos was initiated (a final cause). Their initial excitement about his theory is replaced by disillusionment in the fact that Anaxagoras does not venture beyond mechanistic explanatory principles and offer an account for how Mind has ordered everything for the best. For example, in the Phaedo, Socrates discusses how he followed Anaxagoras’ argument with great joy, and thought that he had found, “a teacher about the cause of things after my own heart” (97d). Socrates’ joy is rather short-lived: “This wonderful hope was dashed as I went on reading and saw that the man made no use of Mind, nor gave it any responsibility for the management of things, but mentioned as causes air and ether and water and many other strange things” (98b). Similarly, Aristotle calls Anaxagoras a sober and original thinker, yet chastises him for using Mind as a deus ex machina to account for the creation of the world: “When he cannot explain why something is necessarily as it is, he drags in Mind, but otherwise hew will use anything rather than Mind to explain a particular phenomenon” (Metaphysics, 985a18). Despite the fact that Anaxagoras did not pursue matters as far as his teleologically-minded successors would have liked, his theory of Mind served as an impetus toward the development of cosmological systems that speculated on final causes. On the flip side, Anaxagoras’ lack of conjecture into the non-mechanistic forces in the world also served as an inspiration to the more materialistic cosmological systems that followed.

b. The Nature of Mind

Thus far, we have examined the role of Mind in the development of the world. But what exactly is Mind, according to Anaxagoras? Based on the evidence in the fragments, this is a rather difficult question to answer, for Mind appears to have contradictory properties. In one small fragment, for example, Anaxagoras claims that mind is the sole exception to the principle that there is a portion of everything in everything, yet this claim is immediately followed by the counter claim, “but Mind is in some things too” (frag. 11). Elsewhere, Anaxagoras emphasizes the autonomy and separateness of Mind:

The rest have a portion of everything, but Mind is unlimited and self-ruled and is mixed with no thing, but is alone and by itself. For if it were not by itself but were mixed with something else, it would have a share of all things, if it were mixed with anything. For in everything there is a portion of everything, as I have said before. And the things mixed together with it would hinder it so that it would rule no thing in the same way as it does being alone and by itself. For it is the finest of all things and the purest, and it has all judgment about everything and the greatest power. (frag. 12)

He goes on to say, however, that Mind “is very much even now where all other things are too, in the surrounding multitude and in things that have come together in the process of separating and in things that have separated off” (frag. 14).

Most commentators maintain that Anaxagoras is committed to a dualism of some sort with his theory of Mind. But his Mind/matter dualism is such that both constituents appear to be corporeal in nature. Mind is material, but it is distinguished from the rest of matter in that it is finer, purer and it appears to act freely. This theory is best understood by considering Anaxagoras’ contention that plants possess minds. It is the mind of a plant which enables it to seek nourishment and grow, but this dynamic agent in a plant is not distinct from the plant itself. This would have been a common biological view for the time, but where Anaxagoras is novel is that he extends the workings of “mind” at the level of plants and animals into a cosmic principle which governs all things. The Mind of the cosmos is a dynamic governing principle which is immanent to the entire natural system while still maintaining its transcendental determining power. From Anaxagoras’ perspective it appears to be a principle which is both natural and divine.

5. Other Theories

Anaxagoras’ theory of things and his postulation of Mind as a cosmic principle are the most important and unique aspects of his philosophy. A few other theories are worth mentioning, though it should be pointed out that many of them are probably not original and our primary knowledge of these views arises from second-hand sources.

As a natural scientist and philosopher of his day, Anaxagoras would have been particularly concerned with the subjects of astronomy and meteorology and he made some significant contributions in these areas. It was mentioned above that his outlook on the heavenly bodies played a part in his condemnation in Athens. His beliefs about the earth, moon and sun are clearly articulated in the following lengthy quote from Hippolytus, a source from the late second century CE:

The earth [according to Anaxagoras] is flat in shape. It stays up because of its size, because there is no void, and because the air, which is very resistant, supports the earth, which rests on it. Now we turn to the liquids on the earth: The sea existed all along, but the water in it became the way it is because it suffered evaporation, and it is also added to from the rivers which flow into it. Rivers originate from rains and also from subterranean water; for the earth is hollow and has water in its hollows. The Nile rises in the summer because water is carried down into it from the snow in the north.The sun, the moon, and all the heavenly bodies are red-hot stones which have been snatched up by the rotation of the aether. Below the heavenly bodies there exist certain bodies which revolve along with the sun and the moon and are invisible….The moon is below the sun, closer to us. The sun is larger than the Peloponnesus. The moon does not shine with its own light, but receives its light from the sun…. Eclipses of the moon occur when the earth cuts off the light, and sometimes when the bodies below the moon cut off the light. Eclipses of the sun take place at new moon, when the moon cuts off the light…. Anaxagoras was the first to describe the circumstances under which eclipses occur and the way light is reflected by the moon. He said that the moon is made of earth and has plains and gullies on it. The Milky Way is the light of those stars which are not lit up by the sun. (A Refutation of All Heresies, 1, epitome, 3)

A key advantage of Anaxagoras’ belief that the heavenly bodies were simply stone masses was that it enabled him to provide an account of meteorites as bodies that occasionally become dislodged from the cosmic vortex and plummet to earth. Plutarch attests that Anaxagoras was credited with predicting the fall of a meteorite in 467 BCE, but it is unclear from the historical attestations whether Anaxagoras’ theory predated or was prompted by the event.

Along with his contributions in Astronomy and Meteorology, Anaxagoras proposed a theory of sensation that works on the principle of difference. The assumption behind Anaxagoras’ theory is that there is some sort of qualitative change that occurs with any sensation or perception. When a cold hand touches a hot object the agent will only experience the sensation of heat because her hand is cold and the hot object has brought about some sort of change. Therefore, in order for this change (the sensation) to occur, it is necessary that unlike things interact with each other, i.e., hot with cold, light with dark. If like things interact—hot with hot, for example—then no change occurs and there is no sensation. Perception works the same way as our sense of touch. Humans are able to see better during the daytime because our eyes are generally dark. Furthermore, perception works the same way as touch for Anaxagoras in that there is a physical interaction with the perceiver and the object perceived. Since a sensation requires an encounter with an opposite, Anaxagoras also maintained that every sensory act is accompanied by some sort of irritation. As Theophrastus notes, “Anaxagoras comes to this conclusion because bright colors are excessively loud noises are irritating, and it is impossible to bear them very long” (On Sense Perception, 27). Anaxagoras theory of sensation and perception is in direct opposition to Empedocles who maintained that perception could be accounted for by an action between like objects.

A couple of final speculations that are worth mentioning pertain to the science of biology. It has already been noted that Anaxagoras believes plants to have minds along with animals and humans. What places humans in a higher category of intelligence, however, is the fact that we were equipped with hands, for it is through these unique instruments that we are able to handle and manipulate objects. Finally, Anaxagoras proposed an hypothesis on how the sex of an infant is determined. If the sperm comes from the right testicle it will attach itself to the right side of the womb and the baby will be a male. If the sperm comes from the left testicle it will attach itself to the left side of the womb and the baby will be a female.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers. New York, NY: Routledge, 1996.
  • Furley, David. Anaxagoras, “Plato and Naming of Parts.” Presocratic Philosophy. Eds. Victor Caston and Daniel W. Graham. Burlington VT: Ashgate Publishing Limited, 2002. 119-126.
  • Gershenson, Daniel E. and Greenberg, Daniel A. Anaxagoras and the Birth of Physics. New York: Blaisdell Publishing Company, 1964. [It should be pointed out that scholars have been rather critical of this work, but it is a rather helpful reference for sources on Anaxagoras.]
  • Graham, Daniel, “The Postulates of Anaxagoras”, Apeiron 27 (1994), pp.77-121.
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. A History of Greek Philosophy. Vol. 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1965.
  • Kirk, G.S., Raven, J.E. and Schofield, M. The Presocratic Philosophers. 2nd ed. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • McKirahan, Richard D. Philosophy Before Socrates. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1994.
  • Schofield, Malcolm. An Essay on Anaxagoras. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
  • Sider, David. The Fragments of Anaxagoras. 2nd ed. revised. Sankt Augustin: Academia Verlag, 2005
  • Taylor, C.C.W. “Anaxagoras and the Atomists.” From the Beginning to Plato: Routledge History of Philosophy, Vol. I. Ed. C.C.W. Taylor. New York, NY: Routledge, 1997. 208-243.

Author Information

Michael Patzia
Central College
U. S. A.

Zhong Hui (Chung Hui, 225–264 C.E.)

Zhong Hui (Chung Hui) was a major philosophical figure during China’s early medieval period (220-589 CE). An accomplished interpreter of the Laozi and the Yijing, Zhong Hui contributed significantly to the early development of xuanxue—literally “learning” (xue) of the “dark” or “mysterious” (xuan) Dao (“Way”), but sometimes translated as “Neo-Daoism". He also was a major political figure whose ambition eventually led to his untimely demise. Virtually all of Zhong Hui’s writings have been lost, which perhaps explains why he has been given scant attention by students of Chinese philosophy. Had he not failed in his attempt to overthrow the regime of his day, no doubt his writings would have been preserved and given the attention they justly deserve. In particular, his views on human “capacity and nature” (caixing), as developed in his interpretation of the Laozi, are major contributions to xuanxue philosophy, which dominated the Chinese intellectual scene from the third to the sixth century CE. In contrast to other thinkers of the time, who argued that capacity and nature are the same (tong), different (yi), or diverge from one another (li), Zhong Hui argued that they coincide (he). In effect, he proposed that what is endowed is potential, which must be carefully nurtured and brought to completion through learning and effort. While one’s native endowment is not sufficient, one must have some material to begin with in order to achieve the desired result. Thus, it cannot be said that the latter has nothing to do with the former.

Table of  Contents

  1. Philosopher and Statesman
  2. Zhong Hui’s Laozi Learning
    1. The “Nothingness” of Dao
    2. Self-Cultivation, Great Peace, and the Nature of the Sage
  3. The Debate on Capacity and Nature
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Philosopher and Statesman

Toward the end of the second century CE, the once glorious Han dynasty (founded in 206 BCE) was already in irreparable decline, with regional military commanders competing for power and control. Among them, Cao Cao (155–220) proved the strongest and in 220 CE his son, Cao Pi (187–226), formally ended the rule of Han and established the Wei dynasty (220–265).

The third century was a time of profound change. The end of the Han dynasty brought political turmoil and hardship; but it also cleared a space for intellectual renewal. The Confucian tradition that dominated much of the Han intellectual landscape now seemed powerless to overcome the forces of disorder that threatened to tear the country asunder. Indeed, to some scholars Han Confucianism was not only ineffective as a remedy, but also part of the problem that led to the downfall of the Han dynasty. New approaches to reestablishing order were urgently needed. In this context, xuanxue was born.

The word xuan literally depicts a shade of black with dark red. It appears prominently in the Laozi, signifying metaphorically the profound unfathomability of the Dao. For this reason, xuanxue has been translated as “Neo-Daoism.” However, while it is true that third-century Chinese philosophers turned to the Laozi for insight, the term “Neo-Daoism” can be misleading because mainstream xuanxue was never a partisan Daoist or “anti-Confucian” movement. Rather, xuanxue scholars saw the whole classical heritage as embodying the truth of the Dao. In other words, Confucius, Laozi, and other sages and near-sages of old were all concerned with unlocking the mystery of Dao, to lay out a blueprint for order. They were all “Daoists” in this sense. What seemed necessary was a radical reinterpretation of the classical tradition that would eradicate the distortions and excesses of Han Confucianism and reestablish the rule of Dao, in both practice and theory, in government and learning. To avoid misunderstanding, most scholars today prefer to translate xuanxue as “Dark Learning,” or more clumsily but less ambiguous, “Learning of the Mysterious (Dao).”

Although the Wei dynasty had to contend with two rival kingdoms during its early years, there was a sense of optimism that order could be restored. There were eager attempts to reform public administration, especially the process of appointment of officials, and law. During the Zhengshi reign period (240–249) of the Wei dynasty in particular, there was a flurry of intellectual activities that saw the first wave of xuanxue scholars arriving on the scene. Zhong Hui was a significant player in this development.

Zhong Hui hailed from a distinguished family, politically influential and known especially for its expertise in law. His father, Zhong You (d. 230), was one of the most powerful statesmen in the early Wei regime and a noted calligrapher and Yijing expert as well. From the start, Zhong Hui was groomed to follow in his father’s footsteps. Zhong Hui himself recounts that he began his formal education under the guidance of his mother with the Xiaojing (Classic of Filial Piety) at the age of three. He then studied the Analects, Shijing (Classic of Poetry), Shujing (Book of Documents), the Yijing (with his father’s commentary), and other classics before he was sent to the imperial academy to further his studies at the age of fourteen. The Zhong family evidently held a special interest in the Yijing and the Laozi. Zhong You had written on both, and Zhong Hui’s mother was also a dedicated student of the Laozi and the Yijing.

As Zhong Hui’s biography in the Sanguozhi (History of the Three Kingdoms) relates, he began his official career as an assistant in the palace library during the Zhengshi era. Reputed for his wide learning and skill in disputation, he was soon promoted to serve as a deputy secretary at the Central Secretariat. At that time, Cao Shuang (d. 249) controlled the Wei court. On the intellectual front, many looked to He Yan (d. 249) as their leader. Zhong Hui was then part of this elite circle. He and Wang Bi (226–249), in particular, were singled out as among the brightest and most promising of their generation. (Wang Bi, of course, now occupies a hallowed place in the history of Chinese philosophy as a brilliant interpreter of the Laozi and the Yijing.)

The scene took a sudden change in 249 when Sima Yi (179–251) successfully staged a coup that led to the death of Cao Shuang, He Yan, and other members of their faction. After Sima Yi’s death, control of the Wei government came into the hands of his two sons, Sima Shi (208–255) and Sima Zhao (211–265). In 265, the latter’s son, Sima Yan, (236–290) formally ended the reign of Wei and established the Jin dynasty (265–420).

The fall of Cao Shuang and He Yan in 249 marked a turning point in Wei politics. Zhong Hui managed to keep out of harm’s way despite his apparent association with the Cao faction. After 249, Zhong Hui was able to retain his post at the Central Secretariat and soon became a key member of the Sima regime. Rising from Palace Attendant to Metropolitan Commandant, and to General of the Suppression of the West in 262, Zhong Hui achieved remarkable success in the political arena. In 263, in recognition of his role in the conquest of the rival kingdom of Shu, he was made Chief Minister of Culture and Instruction, one of the “Three Excellencies” of state. At the height of his power, Zhong Hui considered his achievement to be unsurpassed in the world and that he could no longer serve under anyone. Calculating that he had control of a formidable army and that he could at least claim the land of Shu even if he failed to conquer the entire country, Zhong Hui decided to turn against the Sima government. He was killed by his own troops in the first month of 264.

2. Zhong Hui’s Laozi Learning

Few of Zhong Hui’s writings have survived. A Zhong Hui ji (Collected Works) in nine scrolls has been reported, but it is no longer extant. He was also an accomplished poet; a few fragments of his poetry in the fu (prose-poem) style have been preserved in various sources. Zhong Hui seems to have written two essays on the Yijing, although little of his Yijing learning can now be reconstructed. He was the author of a commentary on the Laozi. He also contributed significantly to a debate on the relationship between “capacity and nature” (caixing).

In early medieval China, caixing was one of the basic topics about which every intellectual was expected to be able to say something. Fu Jia (also pronounced Fu Gu, 209–255), who criticized He Yan during the Zhengshi era and later acted as a major policy maker in the Sima administration, is generally acknowledged to be the leading figure in this debate. Zhong Hui, who became a junior associate of Fu Jia after 249, is said to have “collected and discussed” the latter’s deliberation on the “identity and difference of capacity and nature.” Zhong’s work presents four views on the subject, including his own, and is given the title Caixing siben lun (On the Four Roots of Capacity and Nature). Despite its evident popularity in Wei-Jin China, other than the general position of the four views and the individuals who hold them, which will be introduced later, we have no further knowledge of this work.

According to Du Guangting (850–933), He Yan, Wang Bi, and Zhong Hui all attempted in their interpretation of the Laozi to make clear “the way of ultimate emptiness and nonaction, and of governing the family and the country.” Unfortunately, Zhong Hui’s Laozi commentary has been lost, probably since the end of the Song dynasty (960-1279). Today, we can only see glimpses of Zhong’s Laozi learning through about 25 quotations from his commentary preserved in a number of sources.

When xuanxue became an established trend during the Jin dynasty, its supporters looked back to the Zhengshi period rather nostalgically as the “golden age” of philosophical debate and criticism. The concept of wu—variously translated as “nothing,” “nothingness,” “nonbeing” or “negativity”—is often singled out as the key to this new learning. As the Jin scholar Wang Yan (256–311) puts it, “During the Zhengshi period, He Yan, Wang Bi, and others propounded the teachings of Laozi and Zhuangzi. They established the view that heaven and earth and the myriad things are all rooted in wu.” Zhong Hui was among the “others” who sought to reformulate classical learning by focusing on the mysterious Dao, on the basis of which government and society may be restructured to establish lasting peace and order. What must be emphasized is that xuanxue is not monolithic. The concept of wu generates a new focus, but it is subject to interpretation, with different ethical and political implications.

a. The “Nothingness” of Dao

The concept of wu fundamentally serves to bring out the mystery of Dao, which is “nameless” and “formless,” according to the Laozi, and as such transcends language and sensory perception. As Zhong Hui understands it, the Dao is “shadowy, dark, dim, and obscure; it is therefore described as xuan” (commentary to Laozi 1). The Dao is also described as “silent and void” in the Laozi. This means, Zhong explains, that it is “empty and without substance” (comm. to Laozi 25).

Though formless and nameless, dark and mysterious, the Dao is nonetheless said to be the “beginning” and “mother” of all things (e.g., Laozi 1 and 42). Indeed, according to the Laozi, “All things under heaven are born of you (something); you is born of wu (nothing)” (ch. 40). This obviously requires explanation.

Life is essentially constituted by “vital energy” (qi). This can be regarded as the generally accepted view in traditional China. Applied to the Laozi, this suggests that the Dao should be understood as the source of the essential qi that generated the yin and yang energies at the “beginning.” Through a process of further differentiation, the created order then came into being. As the origin of the vital energy or cosmic “pneuma” that makes life possible, the Dao is indeed formless and nameless, and for this reason may be described as “nothing” (wu), in the sense of not having any characteristics of things. But, wu does not connote metaphysical “nonbeing,” “negativity,” or absence. Zhong Hui shares this view. In contrast, Wang Bi emphasizes in his commentary on the Laozi that the multiplicity of beings logically demands a prior ontological unity. From this perspective, “Dao” does not refer to a kind of primordial, undifferentiated substance, formless and of which nothing can be said; rather, it signifies the necessary ground of being.

According to the Laozi, “Heaven models after the Dao. The Dao models after what is naturally so (ziran)” (ch. 25). According to Zhong Hui, the reason the Dao is described as ziran is that “no one knows whence it comes.” Moreover, the Laozi observes, “The great image does not have any form” (ch. 41). The context suggests that the “great image” is a metaphor for the Dao, and this is how Zhong Hui has understood it: “There is no image that does not respond to it; this is what is called the ‘great image’. Since it does not have any bodily shape, how can it have any form or appearance?” In these instances, the mystery of Dao has little to do with “nonbeing” as an abstract concept, but rather intimates the ever-existing and formless nature of the generative force that brought forth heaven and earth and the myriad beings.

The Dao is also called the “One,” as Zhong Hui interprets the Laozi. It is “ceaseless, indeed, yet it does not have any ties; overflowing, yet it does not become diminished. Subtle and wondrous, it is difficult to name it. In the end, it returns to a state of not being anything (with discernible characteristics)” (comm. to Laozi 14; cf. comm. to Laozi 39). Limitless and ultimately unfathomable, the Dao is indeed “subtle and wondrous” and therefore “difficult to name,” but it is a real presence. The Laozi states that the Dao “stands on its own and does not change.” Zhong Hui explains, “Solitary, without a mate, it is therefore said to be ‘standing on its own’. From antiquity to the present, it is always one and the same; thus it is stated, it ‘does not change’” (comm. to Laozi 25). Further, the Laozi specifically points out that the Dao “operates everywhere and is free from danger” (ch. 25). Zhong Hui’s commentary here reads: “There is no place that the Dao is not present; it is (thus) described as ‘operating everywhere’. Where it is present, it penetrates everything; thus it is without danger.”

For Zhong Hui, the concept of Dao thus explains from a cosmological perspective the genesis of being and the emergence of order in the cosmos. The Laozi may seem to privilege the concept of wu, to bring out the indefinable fullness of the Dao, over the concept of you, which subsumes under it the world of things, but in the final analysis the two are interdependent in enabling the proper functioning of the universe. Finding an apt illustration in a common mode of transportation in early China, the Laozi thus announces in chapter 11 that “thirty spokes” join into one hub; but the use or function of the wheel, and by extension the carriage or cart as a whole, is not so much dependent on the solid spokes as the empty space within the hub. Similarly, clay may be shaped and treated to make vessels, and doors and windows cut out to make a room; but it is the “emptiness” of the vessel or room that makes possible its use or function. “Therefore,” the Laozi concludes, “having something (you) is what produces benefit, (but) having nothing (wu) is what produces use.”

To Zhong Hui, the Laozi makes use of these metaphors “to bring to light that you and wu gain from each other, and neither can be neglected …. Wu depends on you to become of benefit; you relies on wu to be of use.” The relationship between wu and you may be likened to that between “interiority” (nei) and “externality” (wai)—concrete objects are able to function and generate value externally because of their inner capacity endowed by the Dao in the form of vital energies. The interdependence of you and wu represents an intrinsic “law” in a Dao-centered universe (comm. to Laozi 11). This has important ethical implications.

b. Self-Cultivation, Great Peace, and the Nature of the Sage

Derived from the Dao, the world reflects a pristine order. In the ideal Dao-centered world, filial love and respect, for example, would be entirely spontaneous and thus unremarkable, which is why the Laozi regards “filial piety” in the Confucian sense as a virtue that merits praise and has to be perfected if not acquired as having arisen only after the decline of the Dao (Laozi 18). Deliberate effort at bringing love and respect into the world, in other words, proves necessary only after natural filial affection has been lost. Thus Zhong Hui writes, “If the nine generations of the family are all in accord, then love and respect will have no cause to be applied. ‘When the six relations are not in harmony’ [as the Laozi phrases it], then filial piety and compassion will become conspicuous.” The concept of “naturalness” (ziran), in this sense, involves not only the regularity of natural processes and the plenitude of nature but also a perceived “natural” harmony and order in the social arena.

The pristine Dao-derived order has been lost. The aim of xuanxue is to restore this order. For Zhong Hui, the process of recovery begins with self-cultivation, which requires careful tending of one’s qi-energy. According to Zhong Hui, “the soul manages and protects its form and qi, so as to enable it to last long.” This is why the Laozi urges the people to “look after the soul and embrace the One” (comm. to Laozi 10).

Aligned with the yin-yang, cosmological theory, the idea that human beings are constituted spiritually and physically by qi was well established by the third century. No bifurcation of “soul” and “body” is implied. Both are constituted by qi, although the “qi of the blood” may be less “pure” when compared with the more subtle qi of the soul or spirit. In this context, self-cultivation involves both nourishing and purifying the vital qi-energy.

Chapter 12 of the Laozi warns that the “five colors cause one’s eyes to become blind,” and of the other harmful effects that stem from indulging in one’s senses. The Laozi concludes: “For this reason the sage is for the belly and not for the eyes.” Emphasizing the importance of self-cultivation, Zhong Hui relates this to the being of the ideal sage: “The genuine vital energy pervades (the sage’s) inner being; thus it is said, (he is) ‘for the belly’. Externally, desires have been eliminated; thus, it is said, ‘not for the eyes’.”

Here, the complementarity of the “inner” and the “outer” again guides Zhong Hui’s interpretation. The sage is always mindful of his qi-nature in everything he does and certainly does not live to satisfy the senses. On the opening sentence of Laozi 16—“Attain utmost emptiness; maintain complete tranquility”—Zhong Hui again stresses this point: “… eliminate emotions and worries to reach the ultimate of emptiness. The mind is always quiet, so as to maintain complete tranquility.”

Self-cultivation translates into certain effects or ways of doing things at both the personal and political levels. The Laozi states: “The yielding and weak will overcome the hard and strong” (ch. 36). In this same chapter, the Laozi elaborates, “If you would have a thing shrink, stretch it first.” Zhong Hui comments: “If one wishes to control the hard and strong, one assumes the appearance of being submissive and weak. Stretch it first; shrink it afterward—win or lose, (the outcome) is certain.” In chapter 22, the Laozi brings out the central Daoist insight that preservation or fulfillment does not lie in self-aggrandizement or aggressive action but in self-effacement and non-contention, in embracing humility and the way of “yieldingness.” “If one is truly able to keep being yielding,” Zhong Hui reasons, then “everything will certainly return to him”—that is to say, all successes and benefits will as a matter of course belong to him. In the ideal Dao-centered world, this would describe the being of the sage-ruler, who abides by naturalness, acts with “nonaction” (wuwei) in the sense of yieldingness, and whose inner tranquility would ensure the absence of selfish desire and the flourishing of the realm.

The sage is someone who possesses “superior virtue,” as the Laozi describes it. Zhong Hui explains: “(He who) embodies the wondrous and subtle spirit to preserve the transformations (of nature) is (the man of) superior virtue” (comm. to Laozi 38). In the government of the sage, penal laws and punishment do not apply, for the sage is able to transform the people through nonaction, guiding them to regain their natural simplicity (comm. to Laozi 19). This is the reign of “great peace” (taiping) as envisaged by the majority of xuanxue scholars, in which virtues would naturally abound and family relations would be in complete harmony. Can great peace be attained? There is no question that a sage can realize the taiping ideal; but is it the case that sages alone can bring about great peace? Can it not be realized by worthy and able rulers and ministers, who are committed to the way of the sage but are not sages? Zhong Hui could not but be concerned with this question, which began to surface during the Han period and continued to attract debate during the early years of the Wei dynasty. In fact, Zhong Hui’s father, Zhong You, asserts unequivocally that sages are necessary for the realization of great peace.

The role of the sage in realizing great peace presupposes a prior understanding of the nature of the sage. Is “sagehood” inborn, or can it be acquired through effort? This was a major topic of discussion also among the Wei elite. The prevalent view in early xuanxue seems to be that sages are born, not made, a view to which Zhong Hui subscribes and which stems directly from a cosmological understanding of the Dao, particularly the deciding role of qi in shaping the nature and destiny of human beings.

In a cosmological interpretation, the Dao informs all beings, provides them with a “share” of its potent energy, which accounts for their lifespan, capacity, and all other aspects of their being. Sages are exceptional beings, whose qi-endowment is extraordinarily pure and abundant. On this basis, He Yan, for example, thus argues that “sages do not have emotions,” which attracted a substantial following during the Zhengshi period. Zhong Hui was drawn to He Yan’s view and is said to have developed it in his own thinking. As the Sanguozhi relates, “He Yan maintained that the sage does not have pleasure and anger, or sorrow and joy. His views were extremely cogent, on which Zhong Hui and others elaborated.”

Emotions are “impure” qi-agitations that disturb the mind and render impossible the work of sagely government. The sage, blessed with the finest and richest energy that arises from the “One,” is free from such qi-imperfections, which enables him to be absolutely impartial and to realize great peace not only within himself but also in government. The sage, in other words, is utterly different from ordinary human beings. On this view, this is a basic difference in qi-constitution, which amounts to a difference in kind and not in degree. “Sagehood,” in other words, should be understood in terms of a sage nature that is inborn and not an accomplished goal that is attainable through learning and effort.

If Zhong Hui is of the view that sage nature is inborn, why does he emphasize self-cultivation to fortify the qi within and to eliminate desires? As we have seen also, Zhong Hui affirms that the “soul,” if properly managed and protected, can “last long.” Does this show that he believes in the existence of “immortals” (xian) and that it is possible to attain immortality? In a fu poem on the chrysanthemum (Juhuafu), Zhong Hui writes, “Thus, the chrysanthemum … [if ingested] flows within and renders the body light; it is the food of immortals.” Further, in the same poem, Zhong rhapsodizes, “Those who ingest it would live long, and those who consume it would find their spirit unobstructed.” Zhong Hui has also written a fu on grapes (Putaofu), in which he describes the fruit as “having embodied the finest qi in nature.”

It is not surprising that Zhong Hui accepts the existence of immortals, which was a widely held belief at that time. Whether it is an immortal or a sage, the same reasoning applies. Only a select few are endowed at birth with the necessary qi-condition to develop into a sage or immortal. An ordinary human being cannot learn to become a sage, who is a different kind of being, but self-cultivation remains important because it is possible to nourish and purify one’s qi-endowment by means of certain substances and practices. In other words, although complete “transcendence” may be beyond reach, one can remove obstacles to personal fulfillment, prevent corruption of one’s nature, and ensure that one’s capacity is developed to the fullest.

The idea that only sages can realize great peace is grounded in this conception of the nature of the sage. If one believes, as Zhong Hui does, that the sage is of a special breed, absolutely pure and without cognitive-affective qi-disturbances, it would not make much sense to say that even those who are not sages could realize the reign of great peace. The uniqueness of the sage would then be inconsequential. Zhong Hui would thus agree with his father that great peace is an ideal realizable only by sages. Opposed to this is the view that it is possible to attain great peace even without the intervention of sages. What is crucial is that we learn from the ancient sages. If able and worthy individuals such as Yi Yin of the Shang dynasty and Yan Yuan (Yan Hui), the exemplary disciple of Confucius, were entrusted with governing the country, and if their policies would continue for several generations, then great peace may be realized.

From this latter perspective, the difference between a sage such as Confucius and worthies such as Yan Yuan is a matter of degree. Moreover, this implies that we can learn from the sages and worthies, which signals a particular Confucian approach to government and education. Benevolent government requires men of integrity and talent to serve the public good. Education is necessary to transmit the teaching of the sages and to lay a strong moral foundation. Care and compassion are required in the administration of justice. Step by step, with rulers and ministers serving as examples, the transformative power of Confucian virtues would instill benevolence and propriety in the hearts of the people or at least render them willing and obedient subjects. In this way, lasting order and peace may be secured.

Both camps considered Confucius to be the ideal sage. But whereas to some, Confucius was a great teacher, to others he embodied the best of heaven and earth. It would be impossible to be like Confucius in every respect, according to the latter; the assertion that great peace could be realized by able and worthy men would undermine the supra-mundane status of Confucius, who was such an exalted figure as to exclude the possibility of someone else matching his attainment. The sage is fundamentally different from “mere” mortals, and the sage alone can realize lasting peace. This implies a certain distrust of the nature and capacity of the people, who are driven by desires. It is important thus to curb one’s desires and to maintain tranquility. But this, too, can only be achieved by a few. For the majority, laws and models are necessary. They serve as the “outer” instruments that would complement the call to embrace “emptiness” within.

The concept of “law” (fa) is not limited to criminal justice. It concerns proper rulership and sociopolitical order at large. The principles of government must be clearly delineated for the rule of law to apply. In particular, the various duties and functions of officials must be carefully defined, so that there is accountability and quality control. Precisely because great peace can be realized only by sages, and given that sages are rare, government should depend on laws and processes, as opposed to individuals, so that official positions and duties would be occupied and performed by the right persons, laws and punishment would be appropriate, and in all aspects the “inner” and the “outer” would attain their proper balance.

3. The Debate on Capacity and Nature

Although the evidence at our disposal is limited, a consistent approach emerges from the surviving fragments of Zhong Hui’s Laozi commentary. Guided by a hermeneutic that equates the nothingness of Dao with the fullness of qi, Zhong Hui probes the basis of personal well-being and sociopolitical order. The pristine order of the Dao is characterized by intrinsic laws and standards, which ensure the smooth functioning of the cosmos and the integrity of sociopolitical institutions. Order would flourish in this ideal world, and remedial action would be superfluous. In a world where the Dao has declined, only a true sage can realize genuine order and peace. In the absence of a sage-ruler, due process is required to ensure sound governance, social stability and that justice prevails. In the context of early Wei politics, the system of official appointment would be of particular concern to those who seek to reestablish the rule of Dao.

In this context, the debate on capacity and nature may be understood. Zhong Hui is particularly noted for his contribution to this debate, which involves four positions—namely, that capacity and nature are the same (tong); that they are different (yi); that they coincide (he); and that they diverge from each other (li).

Fu Jia apparently initiated the debate by arguing for the first position. The second is represented by Li Feng (d. 254), who was Director of the Central Secretariat and whom Fu Jia denounced as pretentious and false. Zhong Hui held the third view, and Wang Guang (d. 251), who like Zhong Hui was a junior officer during the Zhengshi period, argued for the last position. Zhong Hui’s treatise, however, was no longer available by the early sixth century.

It has been suggested that the debate should be understood in terms of the political struggles between the Cao faction and the Sima faction during the Zhengshi period. Whereas Fu Jia and Zhong Hui (before his attempted revolt) sided with the Sima regime, both Li Feng and Wang Guang were struck down by it. This is an important observation. However, philosophically, what does it mean to say that capacity and nature are the same? In what sense can they be said to “coincide”?

The first position seems relatively straightforward in the light of the concept of qi. Inborn nature can be understood in terms of one’s innate capacity, which encompasses one’s physical, intellectual, moral, psychological, and spiritual endowments. In Fu Jia’s account, both capacity and nature are seen to be determined by qi-endowment. Whereas nature is the inner substance, capacity reaches outward and translates into ability as well as moral conduct. This view finds eloquent support in the Caixing lun (Treatise on Capacity and Nature) by another third-century scholar, Yuan Zhun. All beings that exist in heaven and earth, according to Yuan, can be either excellent or of a bad quality. Whereas the former is endowed with a “pure qi,” the latter is constituted by a “turbid energy.” It is like a piece of wood, Yuan adds: whether it is crooked or straight is a matter of nature, on the basis of which it has a certain capacity that can be made to serve particular ends. The same is true for human beings, who may be “worthy” or “unworthy” by nature. To argue that nature and capacity are the same, Fu Jia cannot but maintain also that sagacity is inborn.

Li Feng counters that capacity and nature are different. Fu Jia had misconstrued the relationship between capacity and nature, because whereas nature may be inborn, capacity is shaped by learning. This suggests that any accomplishment, moral or political, is ultimately dependent on effort. Fu Jia is evidently committed to affirming that a person may be born good or bad, strong or weak, bright or dull, depending on his or her qi-endowment. Li Feng’s counterview, however, proceeds on the premise that nature is “neutral” or unmarked, morally and in all other respects. What is endowed at birth is simply the biological apparatus to grow and to learn, but the person one becomes is a matter of learning and putting into practice the teachings of the sages. Yu Huan, a third-century historian, provides a helpful analogy: the effect of learning on a person is like adding color to a piece of plain silk. This should align with the view that sagehood can be achieved through effort and that sages are not necessary to realizing great peace, given the perceived transformative power of learning.

Zhong Hui’s position may be seen as an attempt to mediate between these two opposing views. Given Zhong Hui’s understanding of qi and the nature of the sage, he would obviously side with Fu Jia in this debate. Yet, the “identity” thesis seems to assume that what is endowed is both necessary and sufficient. Although native endowment is necessary for realized capacity, Zhong Hui is saying, it is not sufficient. Thus, when capacity is said to “coincide” with nature, Zhong Hui is in effect proposing that what is endowed is potential, which must be carefully nurtured and brought to completion. For immortals and sages, who are different in kind because of their exceptional qi-endowment, what is inner in the sense of innate capacity naturally manifests itself completely in extraordinary achievements. For ordinary human beings, however, nature does not amount to actual ability but only furnishes certain dispositions or directions of development. To be sure, if the native endowment is extremely poor, there is not much that can be done. Nevertheless, the real challenge to the identity thesis is that an excellent endowment may go to waste because the person succumbs to desire and would not learn. The inner provides the capital, but it requires external control to maintain its value, to generate profit, and to bring the investment to a successful close.

In response to Li Feng’s critique of Fu Jia, Zhong Hui thus offers a modified identity thesis that takes into account the place of learning and effort. Although having the “right stuff,” as it were, is not sufficient, one must have some material to begin with in order to achieve the desired result. Thus, it cannot be said that the latter has nothing to do with the former. In this context, Wang Guang adds a fourth view, which is stronger than Li Feng’s and appears to be directed especially against Zhong Hui’s position. Inborn nature does not provide the necessary fertile ground for cultivation; rather, it needs to be rectified by learning. Human beings are naturally driven by desire and therefore must rely on rituals and instruction to become responsible individuals. In this sense, capacity and nature do not “coincide” but “diverge” from each other.

The debate on caixing demonstrates the richness and complexity of xuanxue. The debate may have particular political relevance, but it presupposes an understanding of the origin and structure of the cosmos, the role of self-cultivation, the rule of law, the nature of the sage, and other issues central to Wei-Jin thought. The four views engage one another in coming to terms with the basis of goodness and other forms of excellence. Zhong Hui’s view on capacity and nature is consistent with his interpretation of the Laozi, both of which should be recognized as a major contribution to xuanxue philosophy. Had he not attempted to topple the Sima regime, or more precisely had he not failed in that attempt, no doubt his writings would have been preserved and given the attention they justly deserve.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Berkowitz, Alan J. Patterns of Disengagement: the Practice and Portrayal of Reclusion in Early Medieval China. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000.
  • Cai, Zong-qi, ed. Chinese Aesthetics: The Ordering of Literature, the Arts, and the Universe in the Six Dynasties. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2004.
  • Chan, Alan K. L. Two Visions of the Way. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Chan, Alan K. L. “The Essential Meaning of the Way and Virtue: Yan Zun and ‘Laozi Learning’ in Early Han China.” Monumenta Serica 46 (1998): 105–127.
  • Chan, Alan K. L. “The Daodejing and Its Tradition.” In Daoism Handbook, ed. Livia Kohn (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 2000), 1–29.
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Author Information

Alan Kam-Leung Chan
National University of Singapore

John Duns Scotus (1266–1308)

duns-ScotusJohn Duns Scotus, along with Bonaventure, Aquinas, and Ockham, is one of the four great philosophers of High Scholasticism. His work is encyclopedic in scope, yet so detailed and nuanced that he earned the epithet “Subtle Doctor,” and no less a thinker than Ockham would praise his judgment as excelling all others in its subtlety. In opposition to the prevailing thought in metaphysics that the term “being” is analogical, Scotus argues that it must be a univocal term, a view others had feared would bring an end to metaphysics and natural theology. Scotus’s novel account of universals and individuation gained a wide following and inspired brilliant counterarguments by Ockham and Thomist opponents. Despite its flaws, his argument for God’s existence, perhaps the most complicated of any ever written, is a philosophical tour de force. Scotus’s distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition structured much of the discussion of cognition for the rest of the scholastic period. In opposition to such thinkers as Aquinas and Godfrey of Fontaines, Scotus defends a moderate voluntarism in his account of free will, a view that would be influential into the modern period.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
    1. Life
    2. Works
  2. The Subject of Metaphysics
  3. Distinctions
  4. Universals
  5. Individuation
  6. The Argument for God’s Existence
  7. Univocity, Metaphysics, and Natural Theology
    1. Background
    2. Problems Arising from Analogy and Equivocity
    3. Arguments for Univocity
  8. Cognition
    1. Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition
    2. Divine Illumination and Skepticism
  9. Natural Law
  10. Action Theory and Will
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Texts in Latin
    2. Primary Texts in English Translation
    3. Secondary Literature

1. Life and Works

a. Life

No one knows precisely when John Duns was born, but we are fairly certain he came from the eponymous town of Duns near the Scottish border with England. He, like many other of his compatriots, was called “Scotus,” or “the Scot,” from the country of his birth. He was ordained a priest on 17 March 1291. Because his bishop had just ordained another group at the end of 1290, we can place Scotus’s birth in the first quarter of 1266, if he was ordained as early as canon law permitted. When he was a boy he joined the Franciscans, who sent him to study at Oxford, probably in 1288. He was still at Oxford in 1300, for he took part in a disputation there at some point in 1300 or 1301, once he had finished lecturing on the Sentences. Moreover, when the English provincial presented 22 names to Bishop Dalderby on 26 July 1300 for licenses to hear confessions at Oxford, Scotus’s was among them. He probably completed his Oxford studies in 1301. He was not, however, incepted as a master at Oxford, for his provincial sent him to the more prestigious University of Paris, where he would lecture on the Sentences a second time.

The longstanding rift between Pope Boniface VIII and King Philip the Fair of France would soon shake the University of Paris and interrupt Scotus’s studies. In June of 1301, Philip’s emissaries examined each Franciscan at the Parisian convent, separating the royalists from the papists. Supporters of the Pope, a slight majority that included Scotus, were given three days to leave France. Scotus returned to Paris by the fall of 1304, after Boniface had died and the new Pope, Benedict XI, had made his peace with Philip. We are not sure where Scotus spent his exile, but it seems probable that he returned to work at Oxford. Scotus also lectured at Cambridge some time after he completed his studies at Oxford, but scholars are uncertain about exactly when.

Scotus completed his Parisian studies and was incepted as a master, probably in early 1305. As regent master, he held a set of quodlibetal questions (his only set) within two years of his inception. His order transferred him to the Franciscan house of studies at Cologne, where we know he served as lector in 1307. He died the next year; the date traditionally given is 8 November. Pope John Paul II proclaimed his beatification in 1993.

b. Works

Scholars have made considerable progress in determining which of the works attributed to Scotus are genuine. Moreover, many key texts now exist in critical editions: the philosophical works in the St. Bonaventure edition, and the theological works in the Vatican edition. However, others have not yet been edited critically. The Wadding Opera omnia is not a critical edition, and the reliability of the texts varies considerably. Despite its title, Wadding’s Opera omnia does not contain quite all of Scotus’s works. Most importantly, what Wadding includes as the Paris Reportatio on Book 1 of the Sentences is actually Book 1 of the Additiones magnae, William of Alnwick’s compilation of Scotus’s thought based largely but not exclusively on his Parisian teaching. The Parisian Reportatio exists in several versions, but most of it only in manuscript. Scholars are still uncertain about the exact chronology of the works.

Early in his career, Scotus wrote a number of logical works: questions on Porphyry’s Isagoge and on Aristotle’s Categories, On Interpretation, and Sophistical Refutations. His Oxford lectures on the Sentences are recorded in his Lectura, and his disputations at Oxford are recorded in the first set of his Collations. Scotus probably began his Questions on the Metaphysics in the early stages of his career as well, but recent scholarship suggests that Scotus composed parts of this work, in particular on Books VII-IX, after he left England for Paris, and perhaps late in his career. Scotus also wrote an Expositio on Aristotle’s Metaphysics and a set of questions on Aristotle’s On the Soul, but more study is needed to determine their relationship with the rest of Scotus’s corpus.

While still at Oxford, Scotus began reworking the Lectura into his Ordinatio, a fuller, more sophisticated commentary on the Sentences. At some point, probably after writing Book 1 d.5, Scotus departed for Paris, where he continued his work on the Ordinatio, incorporating into later sections material from his Parisian lectures on the Sentences. These Parisian lectures exist only in various versions of student reports, and so are called the Reportatio Parisiensis. Scotus’s early disputations at Paris are recorded in the second set of his Collations. After his inception as master, he held one set of Quodlibetal Questions. Scotus’s Logica, which Wadding’s edition mistakenly includes as Question 1 of Quaestiones miscellaneae de formalitatibus (although Scotus wrote no such work), is a brief but important investigation of what follows from the claim that a and b are not formally identical, and supplements discussions of the formal distinction in the Reportatio and the Ordinatio. Scotus composed his famous treatise De primo principio late in his career. While it cannibalizes large chunks of the Ordinatio, it is nevertheless Scotus’s most mature treatment of the central claims of natural theology. Scholars are still uncertain whether one further work, the Theoremata, is genuine.

Scotus died just a few years after his inception, leaving behind a mass of works he had intended to complete or polish for publication. Nevertheless, he soon exercised as great an influence as any other thinker from the High Scholastic Period, including Bonaventure and Aquinas. Despite fierce opposition from many quarters, and in particular from Scotus’s admiring confrere William Ockham, the Scotist school flourished well into the seventeenth century, where his influence can be seen in such writers as Descartes and Bramhall. Interest in Scotus’s philosophy dwindled in the eighteenth century, and when nineteenth century philosophers and theologians again grew interested in scholastic thought, they generally turned to Aquinas and his followers, not to Scotus. However, the Franciscans continuously attested to Scotus’s importance, and in the twentieth century their efforts sparked a revival of interest in Scotus, which has engendered many studies of high quality as well as a critical edition of Scotus’s writing, eleven volumes of which are now in print. It remains to be seen whether Scotus’s thought will have as great an impact on contemporary philosophy as Aquinas’s or Anselm’s.

2. The Subject of Metaphysics

The medieval debate over the subject matter of metaphysics stems from various proposals in Aristotle’s Metaphysics. These include being qua being (Met. 4.1), God (Met. 6.1), and substance (Met. 7.1). The Islamic philosophers Avicenna and Averroes, powerful influences on Christian scholastic philosophy, are divided on the issue. Avicenna rejects the contention that God is the subject of metaphysics on the grounds that no science can establish the existence of its own subject, while metaphysics can demonstrate God’s existence. He argues instead that the subject of metaphysics is being qua being. We have a common notion of being applicable to God, substances, and accidents, and this notion makes possible a science of being qua being that includes God and separated substances as well as material substances and accidents. In his rejoinder to Avicenna, Averroes holds that the view that metaphysics studies being qua being amounts to the view that metaphysics studies substance and, in particular, separated substances and God. Because it is physics, and not the nobler discipline of metaphysics that establishes God’s existence, there is no bar to holding that God is the subject of metaphysics. Scotus maintains with Avicenna that metaphysics studies being qua being. Of course, among beings, God is preeminent: He is the only perfect being, the being on which all others depend. These facts explain why God occupies the most important place in metaphysics. However, what makes God a proper subject for metaphysics is not that he is God, but that he is a being. Metaphysics also includes the study of the transcendentals, which “transcend” the Aristotelian scheme of the categories. The transcendentals include being, the proper attributes of being (“one,” “true,” and “good” are transcendental terms, because they are coextensive with “being,” each signifying one of being’s proper attributes), and what is signified by disjunctions that are coextensive with “being,” such as “finite or infinite” and “necessary or contingent.” However, anything capable of real existence also falls under the heading of “being qua being” and so may be studied in metaphysics.

3. Distinctions

On Scotus’s view, in order to have an accurate grasp of the structure of created reality and the nature of God, and in order to answer such questions as what individuates substances or how a God with multiple attributes can still be simple, we must first have a clear understanding of the various sorts of identity and distinction that hold among items. What follows is a brief taxonomy of four key sorts of identity and distinction, with particular emphasis on formal identity and distinction, earmarks of Scotistic philosophy. For simplicity’s sake, I will speak below only of distinction and not identity.

1. A real distinction holds between two individuals, x and y, if and only if it is logically possible either for x to exist without y or for y to exist without x. For example, Ricky the cat and Beulah the cow are really distinct, as are your hand and your foot, and a substance and its accident such as Socrates and his paleness. In these examples, either x or y in each pair can exist without the other. Even the paleness can exist without Socrates, although only by divine power. However, God and any creature are really distinct, and while God can exist without any creature, no creature can exist without God. Hence for real distinction it is not necessary that both items in the pair be able to exist without the other.

2. A conceptual distinction results from intellectual activity and does not mark any distinction in the thing itself. Rather, our intellects create distinct conceptions of what is really the same. For instance, to adapt Frege’s famous example, our concept of the Morning Star is distinct from our concept of the Evening Star, and yet the Morning Star and Evening Star are really one and the same thing: the planet Venus.

3. Scotus recognizes the need for a distinction that lies between the real and the conceptual distinction, a distinction that has a foundation in reality and so is mind-independent and yet does not imply real separability. For example, the will and the intellect are really the same, for each is really identical with and inseparable from the soul. However, the will is a free power and the intellect is not, and this is not simply a matter of the way we conceive them. Some sort of less than real but more than conceptual distinction is needed to capture this fact. Scotus calls this sort of distinction the formal distinction. What are distinguished in this case are not things (res) but what Scotus calls “formalities” or “realities” or “entities” in one and the same thing. According to Scotus, x and y are formally distinct if and only if (a) x and y are really the same and (b) x has a different ratio (account or character) than y, and (c) neither ratio overlaps the other. So, although the will and the intellect are really identical, their accounts differ and are mutually non-inclusive, and so they are formally distinct. Likewise, there is a formal distinction between the common nature and the individuator, between a genus and specific difference, between the divine attributes, and between each Person of the Trinity and the Divine Essence.

Scholars are widely agreed that in his early work, at least in the Lectura, when Scotus speaks of distinct formalities in a single thing, he means to identify items that are ontologically robust enough to serve as property bearers. Hence, Scotus can explain a single thing’s having even contradictory properties F and not-F without running afoul of the Principle of Non-Contradiction by contending that the bearer of F is a distinct formality from the bearer of not-F, although the two formalities are really identical. For instance, human nature is common both in itself and in reality, while the individuator that contracts that common nature into Socrates is individual of itself, even though in Socrates the common nature and the individuator are really the same.

In some of his Parisian works, such as the Reportatio (notably 1 d.33) and Logica, Scotus appears to grow more ontologically parsimonious, holding that formal non-identity or distinction within a single thing does not imply absolutely distinct formalities in that thing. Gelber [1974] and Adams [1976] suggest that Scotus changes his mind in response to criticisms his teaching on the formal distinction may have sustained at Paris. Scotus’s mediaeval critics, writing after his death, warned that his account would ruin the doctrine of divine simplicity if indeed it posited a plurality of formalities in God. However, it is hard to tell whether Scotus did in fact change his mind. Both the Reportatio and the Logica maintain that if x and y are formally distinct, that implies that they are not absolutely but only qualifiedly distinct, for they have only a diminished sort of distinction. It is hard to tell from what Scotus writes, however, whether this diminished distinction is sufficient for allowing qualifiedly distinct formalities to bear properties. There is also some evidence that Scotus raises the same ontological cautions about formalities in his Oxford writings (see the admittedly ambiguous Ordinatio 1 d.2 p.2 q.1-4 nn.404-8), independently of any Parisian criticism targeted at his work.

4. Scotus recognizes yet another sort of extramental distinction, one that applies to such items as the color red, which can be deeper or paler, courage, which can be stronger or weaker, and being, which can be finite or infinite. These items vary in the degree, quantity, or intensity of their perfection, that is, in their intrinsic mode. Scotus calls the distinction between such an item and its intrinsic mode a modal distinction, explaining its difference from the formal distinction by contrasting intrinsic modes with differentiae. Each differentia contracting the genus virtue (for instance) into its various species has a different formal character from its genus. However, variations in the depth of one’s courage do not create new species any more than do variations in the intensity of red, in the strength of one’s desire, or in degree of being. Pale red and deep red share the same formal character, as do slight and powerful desires for the same object; they differ only in the degree or intensity with which they exhibit this character. The modal distinction, then, is an even lesser one than the formal distinction.

4. Universals

Medieval philosophers rely heavily on ontological classificatory systems—in particular, systems inspired by Aristotle’s Categories—to show key relations among created beings and to afford us scientific knowledge of them. The individuals Socrates and Plato belong to the species human being, which in turn belongs to the genus animal. Donkeys likewise belong to the genus animal, but the difference rational divides humans from other animals. The genus animal, along with other genera such as plant, belongs to the category of substance. That much is uncontroversial. What mediaeval philosophers debate, however, is the ontological status of these genera and species. Do they exist in extramental reality, or are they merely concepts? If they do have extramental existence, what sort of existence is it? Are genera and species constituents of individuals, or are they separated from individuals? It is with these questions in mind that Scotus articulates his account of common natures. In short, he will argue that common natures such as humanity and animality really exist (although they have a “lesser” existence than individuals), that they are common both in themselves and in reality, and that they combine with individuators, which “contract” them.

The chief obstacle to accepting Scotus’s account of common natures is that his view requires us to accept that there are realites—genera and species—that have a less than numerical unity. Accordingly, Scotus offers a battery of arguments for the conclusion that not all real unity is numerical unity. In one of the stronger arguments, Scotus contends that if all real unity were numerical unity, then all real diversity would likewise be numerical diversity. However, any two numerically diverse things are, as such, equally diverse. In that case, Socrates would be just as diverse from Plato as he is from a line. Our intellects could not, then, abstract anything common from Socrates and Plato. In that case, when we apply the universal concept human being to the two of them, we would apply a mere fiction of our intellects. These absurd consequences show that numerical diversity is not the only sort, and since numerical diversity is the greatest diversity, there must be a real but less than numerical diversity and a real but less than numerical unity corresponding to it. Another argument holds that even if there were no intellects to cognize it, fire would still generate fire. The generating fire and the generated fire would have real unity of form, the sort of unity that would make this a case of univocal causation. The two instances of fire, then, have a mind-independent common nature with a less than numerical unity.

Although common natures are not in themselves individuals, since their proper unity is less than numerical, they are not in themselves universals, either. Following Aristotle, Scotus holds that what is universal is what is one in many and said of many. As Scotus understands this account, a universal F must have the indifference to be predicable in a first mode predication statement of individual Fs in such a way that the universal and each particular are identical. As Cross points out [2002], the sort of identity at work here is representational: The universal F represents each individual F equally well. Scotus contends that no common nature can be universal in this way. True, a common nature has a certain sort of indifference: It is not incompatible with any common nature that it be contracted by some individuator other than the one that does in fact contract it. However, with the exception of the Divine Essence, which is predicable of each Divine Person, only a concept has the indifference to be predicable in the way a universal is predicable.

Although Scotus originates this distinction between universals and common natures, he finds his inspiration for it in Avicenna’s famous assertion that “horseness is just horseness.” As Scotus understands this claim, common natures are indifferent to individuality or universality. Although they cannot actually exist except as individuated or as universal, they are not individuated or universal of themselves. For this reason Scotus characterizes universality and individuality as accidental to the common nature and, therefore, as needing a cause. It is the intellect that causes the common nature to be universal by conceptualizing it under the mode of universality, that is, in such a way that numerically one concept is predicable of a plurality of individuals.

This account of really existing common natures that bear a certain priority over individuals might suggest that Scotus is reworking a Platonic theory of Forms. However, Scotus distances his own account from Plato’s. For one thing, Plato holds that the Forms are the highest realities, while the particular things that participate them are lesser realities. Although Scotus admits that common natures really exist—they have their own being (esse)—because they have a less than numerical unity, they have a correspondingly diminished being. Individuals, in contrast, have numerical unity, and so their being is not diminished: The individual Socrates has more being than the common nature humanity instantiated in him. Furthermore, Plato maintains that the Forms exist independently of the individuals that participate them and of the minds that think them. On Scotus’s view, common natures exist only as constituents of individuals in extramental reality or as concepts in the mind. It is true that among the constituents of an individual, the common nature has a certain natural priority over the individuator: The nature is common not only of itself, but even in reality. Even when it forms a composition with an individuator, there is nothing incompatible about its forming a composition with a different individuator. However, this natural priority does not imply that the common nature can exist independently of its individuator, and so Scotus is correct to distinguish his account from Plato’s. Although Scotus’s important disciple Francis of Meyronnes took pains to liken Scotus’s views to Plato’s, he did so largely by interpreting Plato as a Scotist, not by interpreting Scotus as a Platonist.

5. Individuation

Humanity is a common nature instantiated in both Socrates and Plato. Socrates and Plato, in contrast, are not instantiated in anything further. Scotus calls them “individuals” and “singulars” because they cannot be divided or instantiated the way humanity is. To put the matter another way, Socrates and Plato cannot be divided into subjective parts. What explains their individuality, however, is a matter of vibrant controversy among scholastic philosophers, and Scotus comes to his own influential answer to the question by investigating the merits and flaws of his predecessors’ answers.

Many of these predecessors, such as Aquinas, explain the individuation of material and immaterial substances differently. Accordingly, Scotus begins with a critical refutation of their views on the individuation of material substances and follows this with an account of individuation, applicable to both material and immaterial creatures, that avoids the criticisms plaguing these other views. His first move is to argue that material substance is not individual on the basis of its nature. As we’ve seen (see Section 4), such natures as humanity and assinity are common and have a less than numerical unity, so there must be something besides the nature that explains the individuality of Socrates or Brownie the donkey.

That explanation, according to Henry of Ghent, Scotus’s favorite foil, is a double negation. The first negation is vertical, so to speak. If the item has no subjective parts, that is, if there is nothing further into which it can be divided in the ways that animal and human being are divisible in this Porphyrian tree


then the condition of vertical negation is satisfied. The second negation is horizontal: The item is non-identical with anything “beside” it in the same species. Because Plato and Socrates satisfy both of these conditions, they are individuals.

Scotus objects that Henry’s account is, at best, incomplete. It is true that negations can be explanatory in some cases. Pierre’s absence from the café explains why I do not see him when I arrive there, for instance. However, in the case at issue, resolving the problem requires accounting for a thing’s formal incompatibility with instantiation (having subjective parts), and only a positive feature can explain a formal incompatibility. Moreover, appealing to a double negation only moves the question at issue one stage back. If a material individual cannot be further instantiated because of the double negation, we will still not have a full answer until we discover what explains why it has this double negation, and an answer to that question must appeal to something positive.

The most common scholastic views, espoused by such influential thinkers as Thomas Aquinas, Giles of Rome, and Godfrey of Fontaines, do explain the individuation of substances by appeal to something positive, such as actual existence, quantity, or matter. Scotus heaps arguments against each of these views, but here I will recount one argument aimed equally against all three of these candidates.

Because substance is naturally prior to accident, what explains a thing’s being in any hierarchical substantial ordering must itself be in the category of substance. For instance, Plato is an individual in the species human, in the genus animal. No accident can explain any of these features. The addition of accidents to the species human, for instance, would not produce any individual human, but just an accidental union of the substance human being and those accidents. Scotus lodges largely the same criticism against the view that actual existence individuates, since actual existence too is extrinsic to any creature’s nature and, therefore, accidental to it. Finally, although matter counts as substance and not accident, Scotus’ predecessors argued that it is not matter per se, but matter marked by quantity that individuates, and so Scotus understands the theory that matter individuates as likewise holding that an accident, at least partly, explains the individuation of substance.

The critical discussion of his predecessors leads Scotus to conclude that what explains a substance’s individuation must be something positive and intrinsic to what it individuates. Moreover, it cannot be something common, since what is common can exist in something other than what it in fact exists in, while what explains individuation cannot. Finally, it must fall into the category of substance, since when the individuator is added, the substance is complete. It is the final element in a substance’s metaphysical make-up. Scotus often draws a useful analogy between the individuator and the specific difference. The specific difference rational cannot be divided, and so when it combines with the genus animal to constitute the species human being, the species is indivisible into further species. Likewise, Socrates’s individuator combines with the common nature human to constitute the individual Socrates, who cannot be instantiated. The individuator adds nothing further to his essence, which his common nature fully contains: While it makes him Socrates, it does not make him human. Although Scotus’s account of this individuator appears to remain constant in his many writings, what he calls it varies across works and even within single works. He frequently speaks of it as “the individual entity,” but also as “the individual form” and as “the haecceity.” Perhaps because of its use by C.S. Pierce, this last term has become dominant in contemporary discussions of Scotus on individuation.

6. The Argument for God’s Existence

Although God is not the object of metaphysics, he is nevertheless its goal: Proving the existence and nature of God is what metaphysics aims at. Scotus offers several versions of his proof of God’s existence, all sufficiently similar in language, structure, and strategy to be discussed together. The summary below will not do justice to this argument, perhaps the most complex in all scholastic philosophy. In what follows, the argument’s structure is broadly sketched and some details are furnished of its most important and distinctive subordinate arguments.

Scotus’s argument unfolds in four stages:

A. There is (1) a first efficient cause, (2) a preeminent being, (3) a first final cause.

B. Only one nature is first in these three ways.

C. A nature that is first in any of these ways is infinite.

D. There is only one infinite being.

Scotus’s argument begins in a distinctive way. At stage A, he incorporates various strategies his predecessors used for proving God’s existence into a stage of his single proof: (1) There is a first efficient cause that produced all else but is itself unproduced; (2) there is a preeminent being, one whose nature surpasses all others; and (3) there is a first final cause or ultimate end. At stage B, Scotus argues that a being that has any one of these three primacies will have the other two as well. At stage C, he proves that a being with any of these primacies is intensively infinite. Finally, at D he concludes that there cannot be more than one being with this triple primacy. Since Christianity identifies God as the creator of all but himself, as the being whose causal powers sustain the universe, as the preeminent nature who is infinitely good, wise, and powerful, and as the ultimate end of all things, Scotus identifies the unique being whose existence he takes himself to have proved as the Christian God.

Much of the argument’s interest lies in the subordinate arguments for A1, partly because they serve as the foundation for the rest of the proof, and partly because of their intrinsic philosophical interest. Relying on the common scholastic assumptions that (a) no being can produce itself, (b) there cannot be a circle of productive causes, and (c) every production has some cause, Scotus argues as follows:

Argument I: The Non-Modal Argument for a First Efficient Cause

1. Some being x is produced.

2. x is produced by some other being y.

3. Either y is an unproduced, first producer or is a posterior producer.

4. A series of produced producers cannot proceed interminably.

5. Therefore,
the series stops at an unproduced producer, a first efficient cause that produces independently.

Thus far, Scotus’s argument is typical of those found in scholastic philosophy. However, as he recognizes, philosophers such as Aristotle think that infinite causal series are possible, and so premise (4) appears to beg the question. Scotus’s defense of this vulnerable premise brings a clarity and articulateness to the discussion of infinite causal regression that his predecessors never could muster. Scotus concedes that there can indeed be an infinite accidentally ordered series of produced producers, but there cannot be an infinite essentially ordered series of produced producers, and this latter is all he needs to establish to reach his conclusion. In an accidentally ordered series of causes, in which A causes B and B causes C, B depends on A to bring it into existence, but it does not depend on A in order to be the cause of C. For instance, even if Ricky the cat depended on Furry to sire him, Ricky may now sire kittens himself without any causal contribution from Furry. When philosophers admitted the possibility of infinite causal regresses, it is only accidentally ordered series they had in mind. On the other hand, in an essentially ordered series of causes, B depends on A in order to be the cause of C. For instance, on the mediaeval science that Scotus accepts, a human being depends on the sun’s causal activity to generate another human.

From this key difference between accidentally and essentially ordered causal series, two further differences follow. In an accidentally ordered series, A need not act (or even exist) simultaneously with B in order for B to cause C. Furry may be long dead, and yet his son Ricky can sire kittens. In an essentially ordered series, however, A must exist and act at the very time B produces C. Secondly, in an accidentally ordered series, the causes may be of the same nature (ratio) and order (ordo), while in an essentially ordered series the causes belong to a different nature and order. After all, cause A does not simply bring B into existence, as Furry does Ricky; nor does it make a partial causal contribution, the way Brownie the donkey does when he is hitched to a wagon together with Eeyore. Cause A’s current causal contribution is what explains the fact that B is capable of causing C. However, being of a different nature and order does not imply that A is a higher sort of being than B. Because he is alive, Ricky the cat is a higher nature than the inanimate sun, even if the sun, as a more universal cause, belongs to a different order.

Scotus offers several arguments for the conclusion that there must be a first efficient cause of an essentially ordered series, all of them problematic. In one, he argues as follows:

Argument II

1. If there were an infinite series of essentially ordered causes, the totality of things effected would depend on some prior cause.

2. Nothing can be an essentially ordered cause of itself.

3. If this prior cause were part of the totality of things effected, it would be an essentially ordered cause of itself.

4. Even if there were an infinite series of essentially ordered causes, the totality of things effected would be effected by a cause outside the totality.

This argument does not purport to establish that an infinite series of essentially ordered causes is impossible, but rather that even if there were such a series, there must be a first efficient cause of that series that lies outside the series. However, without further assumptions, the argument does not quite reach its goal: It concludes not that there is a first efficient cause, but only that there is an efficient cause prior to this totality.

Scotus’s most original argument is the following:

Argument III

1. Being possessed of efficient causal power does not necessarily imply imperfection.

2. It is possible that something possesses efficient causal power without imperfection.

3. If nothing possesses efficient causal power without dependence on something prior, then nothing has efficient causal power without imperfection.

4. It is possible that some nature possesses independent efficient causal power.

5. A nature that possesses independent efficient causal power is absolutely first.

6. It is possible that there be an absolutely first efficient causal power.

Like goodness and wisdom, efficient causal power is a pure perfection, and so it is possible for something to have efficient causal power without imperfection. Because dependence is an imperfection, it is possible for something to have independent causal power. This being would not be a link in an essentially ordered series of causes, but would stand at the head of the series as absolutely first. At this stage, however, Scotus has established only the possibility of an absolutely first efficient causal power. That is because he will use this conclusion as the key premise in another version of his argument for God’s existence, in which he will try to demonstrate that an absolutely first efficient causal power actually exists.

Argument IV: The Modal Version

In another objection to what he has written so far, Scotus notes that his argument for a first efficient cause, even if sound, does not count as a genuine demonstration because its premises are merely contingent, even if they are evident. If an argument is to lead us to scientia, the highest form of knowledge, it must be demonstrative: It must contain necessary premises leading to a necessary conclusion. In reply, Scotus offers a reformulated modal argument constructed with necessarily true premises. Scotus reworks his entire non-modal argument for a first efficient cause, but he also notes that we may begin with the conclusion of Argument III:

6. It is possible that there be an absolutely first efficient causal power.

7. If a being A cannot exist from another, then if it is possible that A exist, A exists independently.

8. An absolutely first efficient cause cannot exist from another.

9. An absolutely first efficient cause exists independently.

If an absolutely first efficient cause did not in fact exist, there would be no real possibility of its existing. After all, since it is absolutely first, it is impossible for it to depend on any other cause. Because there is a real possibility of its existing, it follows that it exists of itself.

7. Univocity, Metaphysics, and Natural Theology

a. Background

Once he opts for the view that being qua being is the subject of metaphysics, Scotus argues further that the concept of being must apply univocally to anything studied by metaphysics. If the concept of being applied only equivocally to a group of objects, it would not have the unity necessary to serve as the subject of a single science. It does not help to follow the lead of Aquinas or Henry of Ghent and argue that the concept of being applies to the objects of metaphysics analogously, because in Scotus’s view, analogy is just a form of equivocity. If the concept of being applies to metaphysics’ diverse objects by analogy, in that case too metaphysics cannot be a unified science.

Scotus offers two conditions for a concept’s being univocal: (1) affirming and denying it of one and the same subject is sufficient for a contradiction, and (2) it can serve as the middle term of a syllogism. For example, we can say without contradiction that Karen’s sitting on the jury was voluntary (because she willed to go to court rather than to be fined) and that her sitting on the jury was not voluntary (because she felt pressured into service). In this case, we do not reach a contradiction because the concept voluntary is equivocal. Likewise, the syllogism

No inanimate objects are unfriendly.
Some photocopiers are unfriendly.
Therefore, Some photocopiers are animate.

reaches an absurd conclusion because the term “unfriendly” is used equivocally: While it is used literally in the first premise, it is used in a figure of speech in the second.

b. Problems Arising from Analogy and Equivocity

Scotus finds that unless the concept of being is univocal, both philosophy and natural theology come to ruin, a startling claim in light of the fact that the prevailing mediaeval view up to that time was that philosophy and theology would come to ruin if the concept of being was univocal. Mediaeval philosophers before Scotus commonly thought that the concept of being must be not univocal or equivocal, but analogical: While it is not a pure accident that it applies to such diverse items as donkeys (substances) and dispositions (stubbornness), as well as to both creatures and God, it nevertheless does not apply to these diverse items in the same way. If it did, then being would be a genus, and the various Aristotelian categories would not be fundamentally diverse, but just different species of a single genus. Aristotelian ontology, the foundation of mediaeval philosophy since Alcuin, would have to be scrapped and a new ontology developed to replace it.

The consequences for natural theology would be even direr. Without a univocal concept of being, it would be impossible to construct an a posteriori argument for God’s existence, one that took as its premises facts about the existence of finite creatures. Moreover, unless other concepts besides that of being are univocally applicable to God and creatures, then the sort of philosophical theology exemplified by Anselm and the scholastic thinkers who followed him, meant not just to establish God’s existence but to elucidate his nature, would be impossible. Their universal practice is to discover God’s nature—what God is like in himself—by determining which perfections are pure perfections, perfections that imply no limitation whatsoever. An absolutely perfect God must have all pure perfections and only pure perfections, and so any attribute implying limitation does not characterize God as he is in himself. To determine which are the pure perfections, philosophical theologians use some version of this principle, which has its roots in Anselm (Monologion 15): F is a pure perfection if and only if it is in every respect better to be F than what is incompatible with F. Accordingly, because goodness, wisdom, and power satisfy this criterion for pure perfection, while corporeality and mobility do not, God is good, wise, and powerful, but not corporeal and mobile. However, no one can use the Anselmian criterion to determine what God is like without using concepts that apply univocally to God and creatures.

Scotus explains why this is so in the course of the Ordinatio’s fourth argument for univocity. Either the account of a pure perfection is (a) proper to creatures and inapplicable to God, (b) proper to God and inapplicable to creatures, or (c) univocally applicable to God and creatures. On the first option, whatever pure perfections one discovers by the Anselmian criterion are applicable only to creatures and not to God, a view Scotus finds absurd, presumably because God would not then be the most perfect of all beings possible. The second option, however, entirely rules out using the Anselmian criterion to discover the divine nature. If pure perfections are proper to God, then we must determine which attributes are pure perfections by seeing whether or not God has them. In contrast, to use the Anselmian criterion, one first determines whether or not an attribute is a pure perfection and only then concludes whether it is applicable to God. Options (a) and (b) bring natural theology to a halt because they preclude the use of the Anselmian criterion to discover God’s nature, but no such problems arise if our concepts of pure perfections apply univocally to God and creatures.

In the generation before Scotus, Henry of Ghent, moved by many of the same considerations, had articulated his own unique solution to these problems, a solution that would form the starting point for Scotus’s discussion. On Henry’s view, the intellect can abstract from a cognition of this being, formulating two distinct, simple concepts of being: a concept of being as undetermined but naturally determinable to some sort, which applies to all creatures, and a concept of being that is undetermined and indeterminable—it is by nature unlimited—which applies uniquely to God. There cannot, however, be a single, simple concept of being applicable to all things. That is because every concept has its foundation in some reality, but because he is transcendent, God has no reality in common with creatures. Nevertheless, because these two distinct concepts are both concepts of undetermined being, our intellect cannot easily distinguish them and so conflates them into one confused concept. While this is, strictly speaking, an error, it is a fruitful error, allowing us to reason from knowledge of creatures to quidditative knowledge of God, even though God is transcendent.

We can see in Henry’s account an attempt to secure the advantages of maintaining that the concept of being is univocal without giving up the traditional view that the concept is analogical. Scotus is sympathetic to Henry’s goal. After all, if Henry were successful, then Scotus’s worries about the unity of metaphysics and the possibility of natural theology would disappear. Nevertheless, Scotus finds Henry’s view problematic because, if we accept it, we can reasonably call into question the univocal unity of any concept. If the intellect naturally conflates very close concepts, then how can we be sure that there is a unique concept human being that applies to both Socrates and Plato? There could well be two distinct concepts that we naturally conflate because of their great resemblance.

c. Arguments for Univocity

In reply, Scotus offers a barrage of arguments for univocity and disarms the objection that his view would require the dismantling of Aristotelian ontology. The first of his arguments in the Ordinatio is perhaps his most influential for establishing the univocity of being. Suppose a person P is certain of one concept, but doubtful about others. Because a single concept cannot be both certain and dubious, the concept P is certain of must be different from the ones P is doubtful of. However, P can be certain that God is a being, but in doubt about whether God is a finite or infinite being, a created or uncreated being. Therefore, this concept of being that P is certain of is different from all the other concepts (finite, infinite, created, and uncreated being), but included in them and therefore univocal (Ord. 1 d.3 p.1 q.1-2 n.27). Our concepts of radically diverse beings, such as God and creatures, substances and accidents, still must contain as a component a univocal concept of being. However, this does not imply that these beings are simply species of a single common genus. Instead, finite and infinite are intrinsic modes of being (see Section 3 above), not differences dividing it, and so it does not follow that there is any nature common to God and creature. Nor is finite being in turn a genus and the categories its species. Each category is fundamentally diverse, with substance prior to all non-substance categories (Ord 1 d.3 p.1 q.3 n.164). Despite this diversity, our concept of each category includes a univocal concept of being as a component.

Scotus can use this same argument to show the univocity of other concepts besides being, such as goodness, wisdom, and power, which are likewise attributed to God. The universal practice of natural theology, that is, metaphysical inquiry about God, confirms the argument’s conclusion by showing that natural theologians are committed to univocity. First, they apply the Anselmian criterion to discover which notions are applicable to God, a criterion whose use, as we have seen, already presupposes univocity. Once they have formed a list (for example, goodness, wisdom, power, happiness), they remove the imperfection connected with these notions in the case of creatures. Finally, they ascribe to these notions the highest degree of perfection and attribute them to God. What is important, however, is that throughout this process the formal notions remain the same whether applied to creatures or to God.

Scotus’s arguments for univocity do not rule out the possibility of analogical predication. In addition to a univocal concept of wisdom applicable to both God and intellectual creatures, there is a concept of wisdom proper to intellectual creatures, which specifies wisdom as finite and qualitative, and a concept of wisdom proper to God, which specifies wisdom as formally infinite. The two concepts are constructed of a plurality of components, some of which diverge, but each contains this identical component: the simple, univocal concept of wisdom. The same will be true of all analogical concepts: They will diverge in some of their components, but at their root will lie a simple, univocal component that they share. We can see how the concepts diverge only after we have noted what they have in common. Hence, although analogy is possible, it is possible only because of univocity.

We might worry that Scotus’s teaching on univocity threatens the traditional religious doctrine of divine transcendence, a doctrine Scotus himself endorses. According to that doctrine, God is wholly different from creatures, having no reality in common with them. However, Scotus’s teaching on univocity seems to imply that God and creatures have absolute perfections in common, since such predicates as “good,” “wise,” and “being” are attributable to God and creatures in the same way and the same sense. Scotus replies to the objection about divine transcendence by reminding us that his remarks on univocity constitute not a metaphysical doctrine, but a logical one. The metaphysical divide between God and creatures is a radical one, for God and creatures have no reality in common. God’s absolute perfections, such as his being, wisdom, and goodness, which are infinite, are utterly diverse from ours, which are finite. However, by removing from our concepts of absolute perfections those features that make them proper to God or proper to creatures, such as the modes finite or infinite, we can form “incomplete” concepts of absolute perfections univocally applicable to both God and creatures. The formation of such concepts, therefore, does not impugn divine transcendence.

8. Cognition

a. Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition

Scotus distinguishes two sorts of cognition. Cognition of a thing insofar as it actually exists and is present is intuitive cognition, while cognition of a thing that abstracts from actual existence is abstractive cognition. Some sensory cognitions are abstractive, as when one daydreams about pears ripe for the picking. This cognition conveys no information about the way any actual pears are. Other sensory cognitions are intuitive, as when one sees, smells, or touches a pear ripe on the tree. This cognition does convey information about these actually existing pears. More interesting, however, is Scotus’s application of this distinction to intellectual acts. We clearly have intellectual abstractive cognition. When the sensory powers furnish it with phantasms, the intellect can understand the natures of things, and that sort of understanding in turn makes scientific knowledge possible. However, one can have abstractive cognitions, even scientific knowledge of, saber-toothed cats and dodo birds without the slightest idea that they do not actually exist.

Do human beings also have intellectual intuitive cognitions? Sometimes Scotus seems hesitant to admit that we do; after all, in this life, at any rate, human beings cognize things intellectually through phantasms. However, in many passages he argues that we regularly cognize things intuitively. After all, if we did not have an intuitive cognition of things as actually existing, how could we reason about the particular objects around us? Moreover, since my intellectual acts are not directly accessible to my senses, the only way I could know them without reasoning inductively from their effects is by intuitive cognition. Finally, appealing to the principle that whatever a lower power can do, a higher power can also do, Scotus concludes that, because sensory powers are capable of both intuitive and abstractive cognition, so is the intellect. Scholars disagree about whether Scotus’s apparently conflicting claims about intuitive cognition can be reconciled, with Day [1947] arguing for consistency, Wolter [1990a] contending that Scotus changes his views over time, and Pasnau [2003] opting for inconsistency. Despite the problems about what Scotus in fact thinks, the distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition itself exercised an enormous influence, most notably on Ockham, but on nearly all subsequent scholastic discussions of cognition, especially those devoted to certainty and skepticism.

b. Divine Illumination and Skepticism

At the end of the thirteenth century, the theory of divine illumination still had its defenders, although fewer and fewer. The theory had been widely accepted, thanks to Augustine’s many and powerful arguments in its favor. Even early in his career, Augustine had argued that purely natural processes cannot result in knowledge. A teacher’s discourse can lead us to true beliefs, but knowledge requires something further: One must “see” that what the teacher says is true, a sort of justification available only through God’s special illumination of the mind. Augustine’s arguments exerted their influence for more than eight centuries, despite opposition from such formidable opponents as Aquinas, who contends at the very least that no special divine illumination is necessary for knowledge. The illumination theory’s last able defender is Henry of Ghent, whose influential writings kept the theory alive until Scotus wielded his pen against it.

Henry argues that our cognition of things would fall short of certainty without God’s special illumination, for two reasons. First, when we cognize things intellectually by purely natural processes, our cognition stems from an exemplar that is itself changeable. With a changeable basis, our cognition must likewise be changeable and so not certain. Second, the other basis of our cognition, the human soul, is likewise changeable and therefore fallible. We can attain certain knowledge, therefore, only if we have access to the unchangeable, uncreated exemplar, which only God can grant by a special illumination.

Scotus offers some brief but influential objections to Henry’s version of the theory. Henry maintains that what is in the soul as a subject is mutable, even its own act of intellection; but if that is the case, then an illuminated intellection is itself mutable. In that case, even divine illumination fails to preserve the soul from error. Moreover, Henry contends that created as well as uncreated exemplars play a role in producing certain knowledge. However, because the created exemplar is incompatible with certainty, adding an uncreated exemplar does not achieve certainty any more than adding necessary premises to contingent ones in an argument results in a necessary conclusion.

These negative arguments take aim at Henry’s version of the theory of illumination in particular, not against any and every version of the theory. However, Scotus did considerable damage to any future attempts to formulate a divine illumination theory by undercutting its motivation. On his view, we do not need a theory of illumination to show that certain knowledge is possible. The human intellect, by purely natural processes, can attain it, and in four sorts of cases:

1. We can have certain knowledge of principles because they are self-evident through their terms. As long as one grasps the meaning of the terms, one immediately sees that the principle is true. For instance, anyone who understands the term “whole” and “part” has a certain and immediate grasp of the principle that the whole is greater than the part.

2. Experience can also result in certain knowledge, such as our knowledge that magnets attract iron. This sort of knowledge is partly grounded in the first sort, because it depends on our certain knowledge of the principle “Whatever results for the most part from an unfree cause is that cause’s natural effect,” which is self-evident through its terms. On the basis of this principle and experience, we can gain certain knowledge through induction.

3. We can have certain knowledge of our acts and mental states, such as whether we are understanding or willing. We can even be certain that we are seeing, Scotus contends. If I see a flash of light, but there is no light in the room, the species causing my visual act must still exist in my eye, and so I am genuinely seeing something, although not something outside my own body. The level of certainty we gain from knowledge in this case is no less than that we gain from grasping principles evident through their terms.

4. We can also have certain sensory knowledge, thanks to the same self-evident principle that grounds the certainty of induction. If the same object, always or for the most part, causes multiple senses to judge that it has property F, then we can be certain that the object really has property F. Even if the senses conflict, as when vision tells us that the distant Goliath is smaller than the nearby David, but hearing tells us that Goliath’s stentorian voice comes from a giant, we can still attain certain knowledge by appealing to self-evident principles to correct the erroneous judgment.

9. Natural Law

Scholastic philosophical theologians are taxed not just with solving philosophical problems and creating philosophical systems, but with doing so in ways consistent with Biblical religion. Now, Genesis reports that the holy patriarch Abraham set out to kill his own son and that the holy patriarch Jacob took two wives, while Exodus tells of midwives who lied to Pharaoh and yet were rewarded by God. For a scholastic thinker, these texts would naturally raise questions about the status of the natural law, especially that portion of it recorded in the Ten Commandments, or Decalogue. If, as the scriptures suggest, these agents did not do wrong in acting as they did, did they not, despite appearances, violate the natural law? Or did God grant a dispensation from the law?

It is with these issues in mind that Scotus offers his most revealing discussion of the natural law. According to Scotus, God has in fact offered dispensations from the law. Dispensation may take two forms: God can revoke the law, or God can clarify the law. However, even God is limited in the extent to which he can dispense. That is because the natural law in the strict sense consists of laws known through themselves on the basis of their terms. Because they are logically necessary truths, they cannot be revoked, at the very least. Scotus takes the first two commandments of the Decalogue to belong to the law of nature in the strict sense. The commandment to love God, for example, exemplifies the principle that what is best is to be loved most, which is known through itself. Even God could not make it licit to hate him.

The natural law in the broad sense consists of laws that are “exceptionally harmonious” with the natural law in the strict sense. These laws are not known through themselves on the basis of their terms; their truth value is contingent. Therefore, God can grant dispensations from these laws, which include all the commandments in the second table of the Decalogue. Unfortunately, Scotus does not explain what he means when he says that the law of nature in the broad sense consists of laws that are “exceptionally harmonious” with the law of nature in the strict sense, and his vagueness has inspired astoundingly different interpretations of his account of natural law.

In some texts, Scotus presents a view of moral goodness that appears to be largely naturalistic. For example, in his 18th Quodlibet, Scotus writes that an agent’s act is morally good if it has an appropriate object, is performed in appropriate circumstances, is of a sort appropriate for the agent to perform, and furthermore if the agent rightly judges this to be the case and then acts on that judgment. To make these judgments about appropriateness, one needs to know only the nature of the agent, of the act, and of the power through which the agent performs the act. The moral law in its broad sense is therefore based on the natures of things and is accordingly rationally accessible to humans. On this interpretation, since human nature and human powers remain constant, the law of nature in the broad sense could change only if circumstances change, rendering appropriate what used to be inappropriate (or vice versa); in that case, however, God’s act of dispensation would seem little more than a formality.

In other texts, such as Ordinatio 1 d.44 n.6, Scotus appears to hold that what constitutes the natural law in the broad sense is simply God’s will: God wills certain propositions to be law, and they are thereby law. There is nothing self-contradictory about a system of law very different from the one we live under, for instance, a system that at least sometimes permits the killing or torture of the innocent, the telling of falsehoods, and stealing others’ property, and so no logical necessity of the sort we find in the first commandment constrains God from promulgating an alternative system of laws such as this. As Williams [1998] notes in reply to the objection that such a system is inconsistent with God’s own justice, Scotus contends that God can do whatever is not logically impossible, and whatever God wills is by that very fact right (Rep. 4 d46 q4). God’s justice, therefore, does not constrain his will to any single consistent system of laws; he may will any consistent system. It is simply God’s will that certain propositions comprise the moral law rather than others. If the laws we in fact live under benefit us, that is due to God’s graciousness, not his justice. On this interpretation, however, it is hard to see how human beings have rational access to the natural law. Williams [1997] suggests that the Biblical assertion that God writes his commandments on our hearts be interpreted to mean that God gives us moral intuitions that accord with his commands, but if that is the case, when God grants dispensations, those very intuitions (and the moral and cultural institutions built on them) would lead us far astray.

10. Action Theory and Will

Mediaeval philosophers agree that human acts have their source in the powers of will and intellect, and in articulating their detailed action theories and rich moral psychologies, these thinkers spell out the respective roles of the will and intellect. They often disagree, however, about what those roles are and, in particular, about the relative priority of these powers in the production of human acts, with intellectualists giving greater priority to the intellect and voluntarists to the will. Of course, that priority could take many forms, and so we find mediaeval philosophers investigating the extent to which the intellect influences, determines, causes, or necessitates the will’s act, and vice versa; whether our freedom or control over our acts stems more from the will, the intellect, or equally from both; and whether we resemble God more in our intellects or in our wills. While most mediaeval thinkers offer nuanced theories, the views of Aquinas, Giles of Rome, and Godfrey of Fontaines are predominately intellectualist, while those of Henry of Ghent and Peter John Olivi are predominately voluntarist. The debates between intellectualists and voluntarists are important not just because they represent disputes over the origination of human acts, but because they also represent deep disagreements on the nature of free will and rationality, on what makes humans morally responsible, and on the role of virtue in morality.

Scotus’s action theory is largely voluntarist. Although he admits that the intellect plays an important role in human action (after all, the will cannot will something that the intellect is not thinking of, nor can it will something that the intellect does not perceive as somehow good), in contrast to intellectualists such as Aquinas, Scotus denies that the intellect’s judgment about what one should pursue or avoid ever determines which alternative the will wills or, for that matter, whether it wills anything at all. Moreover, the will plays a large role in determining what the intellect thinks: Once the intellect has some object in mind, no matter how peripherally, the will can direct the intellect’s focus and regulate its thought accordingly.

Scotus means to show not just that the will is a higher power than the intellect, however. He argues for the remarkable claim that the will is unique among all created powers because it alone acts freely. Scotus’s account of the will’s freedom is complex, to say the least: In no other discussions does Scotus do more to earn his epithet “subtle.” Nevertheless, the following three key elements of his account should serve to summarize his audacious but sometimes murky discussion.

1. Some potentialities have natures that determine what operations they will or will not perform in any given set of circumstances. A 400 degree oven always operates the same way, and so unless there is some impediment, it will roast meat and dry clay, for that is the nature of heat. The way such human powers as the senses, sensory appetites, and even the intellect operate is also determined by their natures, even if they do have a greater intrinsic value than mere heat. The only power whose nature does not determine its operations is the will, which alone is a self-determining power for opposites. Among created things, the will alone transcends nature, not because it does not have a nature, but because no nature, including its own, determines its acts [Boler 1993]. The will, then, satisfies one necessary condition for freedom: It determines itself regarding opposites; that is, it determines whether it wills this object or that one, and also whether it wills this object or refrains from willing entirely.

2. The will’s capacity for self-determination is a necessary but not a sufficient condition for freedom because, as Scotus argues, even self-determined operations may be necessary. If the will’s acts are to be free, they must be contingent. To see what Scotus means, consider the following “diachronic” account of contingency. At time T1, the will has a real potentiality for willing a or b, as well as for refraining from willing. At time T2, the will determines itself to one of these alternatives, say, a. The proponent of this view admits that at T2 there is no longer a real potentiality for both opposites, but that does not matter because the real potentiality for opposites at T1 ensures the contingency of the will’s operation at T2. That strategy fails, Scotus argues, because contingency can be a feature only of something that is actual, and at T1 the will’s operation is not actual. Therefore, nothing at T1 can explain why the will’s operation at T2 is contingent. Rather, we must look for some feature of the will at T2 if we are to find an explanation of its contingency.

Scotus therefore argues that at T2 the will is really capable of opposites, even when it is determined to one of them. Like all the soul’s powers, the will is a first actuality, and so naturally prior to its operations, which are second actualities. To capture this idea of natural priority within a single instant of time, Scotus employs the device of instants of nature. In a single temporal instant T2 we find instants of nature N1 and N2. At N1 the will has a real potentiality for either a or b. At N2, the will determines itself to a. However, because all this occurs in a single instant of time T2, it is still true because of N1 that at T2 the will has a real potentiality for b, even though at that very temporal instant it is actually willing a. Therefore the will’s operation at T2 is contingent because of features true of the will at T2. Because the will’s operation is both contingent and self-determined, it is free. Finally, it is worth noting that this view does not imply the absurdity that the will can simultaneously will multiple opposites. For instance, a person cannot at the same time both intend to pursue a college degree and intend to stay out of school forever. Rather, if a person at T2 intends to pursue a college degree, there is at T2 the real potentiality for intending to stay out of school forever, but not for intending both.

3. Medieval eudaimonist philosophers contend that the will is determined to seek happiness, that is, the fulfillment of one’s nature. However, because one can at least partly determine the constituents of happiness, and because one can pursue happiness by different means, this determination of the will does not introduce any necessitation incompatible with free will and moral responsibility. Nor does eudaimonism amount to psychological egoism, because justice and its associated virtues are themselves constituents of or at the least, means to the fulfillment of one’s own nature. Eudaimonism, therefore, is no opponent of the moral life. Scotus, however, finds this line of thought problematic, and in spelling out his alternative to eudaimonism he articulates the third element in his discussion of freedom.

Drawing on Anselm’s discussion in On the Fall of the Devil, Scotus contends that in addition to the affection for the fulfillment of one’s nature, or affection for advantage, the will has a second affection, the affection for justice. Thanks to the affection for advantage, the will can seek things insofar as they benefit the willer. Thanks to the affection for justice, the will can seek things insofar as they are good in themselves. As Boler [1993] points out, the presence of the affection for justice over and above that for advantage explains two closely related human characteristics: the will’s capacity to transcend what is natural and the sort of freedom necessary for moral responsibility.

The precise sort of freedom Scotus thinks the affection for justice affords us, however, remains unclear. He might mean that our having the affection for justice in addition to the affection for advantage gives us moral freedom, that is, the freedom to determine whether and to what extent we will act justly. On the other hand, he might mean that having the affection for justice gives us metaphysical freedom, the freedom of self-determination. There is some reason to think that Scotus means both. In a famous example, Scotus asks us to conceive of a creature with an intellectual appetite that has merely one affection, the affection for advantage (because it lacks the affection for justice, this appetite does not count as a genuine will). Such a being, Scotus contends, would always seek its advantage and seek it to the maximum possible, for there would be no countervailing affection to place any restraints on its pursuit of advantage. It would therefore lack both moral freedom and metaphysical freedom as well. However, Scotus offers few details, and it is hard to see why such a creature could not have metaphysical freedom, even if it lacks moral freedom. If the will’s self-determination were limited to balancing the willer’s own advantage against the concerns of justice, then it would be easier to see Scotus’s motives for associating the affection for justice with metaphysical freedom. However, Scotus holds that it is possible, without any intellectual error or misleading passion, to will something unjust that is still less advantageous than an alternative open to the willer. In this case, the affection for justice plays no apparent role in explaining the will’s self-determination, and so it has struck some scholars that the addition of this affection explains the will’s moral freedom but not its metaphysical freedom. On the other hand, Scotus insists that the will’s two affections are not independent wills. Rather, the “addition” of the affection for justice transforms the intellectual appetite so that when one wills, the will always acts with both affections. One cannot “use” just one affection and not the other, even if one is pursuing simply one’s own advantage or simply justice. However, these observations still do not explain how the addition of the affection for justice affords the will metaphysical freedom (if in fact it does), and Scotus says little to shed any more light on the subject.

11. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Texts in Latin

  • Cuestiones Cuodlibetales (1963). In ed. Felix Alluntis, Obras del Doctor Sutil, Juan Duns Escoto. Madrid: Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos.
  • Opera Omnia (1639), ed. Luke Wadding. Lyons, 12 vols., revised and enlarged by L. Vives (1891-1895). Paris, 26 vols.
  • Opera Omnia (1950-). Ed. Scotistic Commission. Vatican City: Typis Polyglottis Vaticanis, 11 vols. prepared to date.

b. Primary Texts in English Translation

  • Duns Scotus, Metaphysician (1995). Ed. and trans. William A. Frank and Allan B. Wolter. West Lafayette: Purdue University Press.
  • Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality (1986). Ed. and trans. Allan Wolter. Washington: Catholic University of America Press.
  • John Duns Scotus: The Examined Report of the Paris Lecture (Reportatio I-A), vol. 1 (2004). Ed. and trans. Allan B. Wolter and Oleg V. Bychkov. St. Bonaventure: The Franciscan Institute.
  • John Duns Scotus: God and Creatures (1981). The Quodlibetal Questions. Trans. Allan Wolter and Felix Alluntis. Washington: Catholic University of America Press.
  • John Duns Scotus: A Treatise on God as First Principle (1983). Ed. Allan Wolter. Chicago: Franciscan Herald Press.
  • Philosophical Writings (1987). Trans. and ed. Allan Wolter. Indianapolis: Hackett.

c. Secondary Literature

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord (1976). “Ockham on Identity and Distinction,” in Franciscan Studies 36: 5-74.
  • Boler, John (1993). “Transcending the Natural: Duns Scotus on the Two Affections of the Will,” in American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 67: 109-22.
  • Boulnois, Olivier (1989). “Analogie et univocité selon Duns Scot: La double destruction,” in Les etudes philosophiques 3/4: 347-83.
  • Cross, Richard (1999). Duns Scotus. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cross, Richard (2002). “Duns Scotus on Divine Substance and the Trinity,” in Medieval Philosophy and Theology 11:181-201.
  • Day, Sebastian (1947). Intuitive Cognition: A Key to the Significance of the Later Scholastics. St. Bonaventure: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Dumont, Stephen (1987). “The Univocal Concept of Being in the Fourteenth Century: I. John Duns Scotus and William of Alnwick,” in Medieval Studies 49: 1-75.
  • Gelber, Hester Goodenough (1974). Logic and the Trinity: A Clash of Values in Scholastic Thought, 1300-1335. Ph.D. dissertation, University of Wisconson.
  • Gracia, Jorge J.E (1984). Introduction to the Problem of Individuation in the Early Middle Ages. Washington: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • King, Peter (2003). “Scotus on Metaphysics,” Chapter 1 in Williams [2003], 15-68.
  • Pasnau, Robert (2003). “Cognition,” Chapter 9 in Williams [2003], 285-311.
  • Williams, Thomas (1997). “Reason, Morality, and Voluntarism in Duns Scotus: A Pseudo-Problem Dissolved,” in The Modern Schoolman 74: 73-94.
  • Williams, Thomas (1998). “The Unmitigated Scotus,” in Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie 80: 162-81.
  • Williams, Thomas, ed. (2003). The Cambridge Companion to Duns Scotus. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wolter, Allan (1990a). “Duns Scotus on Intuition, Memory, and Our Knowledge of Individuals,” Chapter 5 in Wolter [1990b], 98-122.
  • Wolter, Allan (1990b). The Philosophical Theology of John Duns Scotus, ed. Marilyn McCord Adams. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Wolter, Allan (2003). “The Unshredded Scotus: A Reply to Thomas Williams,” in American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 77: 315-356.

Author Information

Jeffrey Hause
Creighton University
U. S. A.

Chauncey Wright (1830—1875)

Chauncey_WrightChauncey Wright, an American mathematician, philosopher, and intellectual catalyst of the Septum and the Metaphysical club at Cambridge, was a great influence on Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, Oliver Wendell Holmes, and Nicholas St. John Green. Unfortunately, Wright’s untimely death at the age of forty-five severed his growing influence on the direction of early-classical American philosophy, just when his intellectual powers were reaching their peek. Apart from some recent studies on his work, spearheaded by the eminent Wright scholar Edward H. Madden, his keen perspectives have been overlooked by both classical and contemporary American philosophers. As a thinker of the transition from early to classical American philosophy, Wright’s work captures the best of Scottish realism, English empiricism, and early science studies, especially in mathematics, physics, biology, meteorology, psychology, jurisprudence, and pedagogy, combining to establish his influence as a well-rounded, critic of system building, metaphysics, theological influence, and the imprecise use of language. His critical empiricism positioned him against any fusion of teleology in philosophy and science. He was one of the first supporters and careful readers of the work of Charles Darwin in the States, winning praise from Darwin for his clear minded approach and style, especially in his work on evolutionary psychology. Wright’s letters are the clearest testaments to his dynamic and personable style. They are exemplary of his patience and depth of cultural preparedness and prime examples of what he must have been like as a Socratic dialogue partner and “intellectual boxing master,” as C.S. Peirce stated. The collected reviews and essays by Wright demonstrate his range and precision of argument, though many reviews and scientific essays still remain uncollected. As his friend John Fiske wrote, “to have known such a man is an experience one cannot forget or outlive, and to have him pass away, leaving so scanty a record of what he had it in him to utter, is nothing less than a public calamity.”

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
    1. Letters
  2. The Language and Philosophy of Science
    1. Mathematics and Adequate Nomenclature
    2. Cosmology as “Cosmic Weather”
    3. Evolution as Theory of Natural Selection
  3. Theory of Knowledge
  4. History of Philosophy
  5. Pedagogy and the Philosophy of Education
  6. Recollections, Influence, and Critical Reception
  7. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Work

Chauncey Wright, mathematician, philosopher, was born at Northamptom, Massachusetts, September 20, 1830. He entered Harvard College in 1848, where he graduated twenty-seventh in a class of eighty-eight in 1852. From 1852 to 1870 Wright was employed as a computing machine for the American Ephemeris and Nautical Almanac at Cambridge, turning series of numbers into logarithms and vice versa, computing charts (ephemerids) for navigation based on the positions of the fixed stars, moon, sun and other planets. Wright taught natural philosophy at the Agassiz School for Girls from 1859 to 1860. He was elected a fellow of the American Academy of Arts and Science in 1860. In January 1870 he was offered a lecture series on psychology at Harvard College as part of the new post-graduate courses. These lectures were based on and developed from what was found in the work of the Scottish philosopher Alexander Bain (1818-1903). The lecture series, begun by Harvard’s former president Thomas Hill, had been revitalized by the then president C.W. Eliot, who also secured lectures from R.W. Emerson, W.D. Howells, F. Bôcher, C.S. Peirce, O. W. Holmes Jr., and J.Fiske. In 1874 and 1875 Wright also lectured in theoretical physics. This was the extent of Wright’s college teaching experience, and though not successful in a classroom setting, his reflections on education and pedagogy were inspiring to his friend, fellow classmate, and Dean of Harvard College, Prof. E. W. Gurney. Gurney describes how “[Wright had] some ten clever sophomores in the course; but his heavy artillery was mostly directed over their heads. They complained much to me (as Dean) of their inability to follow him; but Chauncey, with the best intentions, found it almost impossible to accommodate his pace to their short stride. His examination-papers, by the way, in this course, I remember as models of what such papers should be. Chauncey had as sound views on the subject of education, as fresh and original, and as little biased by his own peculiar training and deficiencies of sympathy, as those of anybody I ever listened to, but he has no adaptability in practice.” (Letters 212-213).

Wright’s pedagogical talents were better seen in his being a private tutor, philosophical mentor, and intellectual catalyst of both the “Cambridge Septum Club” and the “Metaphysical Club” in Cambridge. It was through the discussions and papers presented at these gatherings that Wright came to be known and respected as the “intellectual boxing master” to Charles Sanders Peirce, William James and Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr. Also present at these gatherings were Nicholas St. John Green (1830-1876), Joseph Warner, Frank E. Abbot, and John Fiske. The scientist-philosophers of The Metaphysical Club were nearly outnumbered by members who were lawyers (Fisch 1942; Wiener 1948). Wright died in Cambridge, Massachusetts on September 12, 1875.

Wright published fifty-six articles between 1865 and 1875, the last published posthumously in 1876 in the American Naturalist. These ranged from book notices and reviews to longer technical philosophical and scientific essays. Except for his presentations to the Septum Club, and the Metaphysical Club, all lost to us except in short citations and titles mentioned in his letters, these articles are what remain of his work. He published in The Atlantic Monthly, The Mathematical Monthly, The North American Review, The Nation, Memoirs of the Academy of Arts and Sciences, Proceedings of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, and the American Naturalist. Eighteen of his longer articles were collected and published in 1877 by his friend Charles Eliot Norton under the title Philosophical Discussions. There exists one generously detailed review, though anonymous, of this text from The Nation, dated May 17, 1877, vol. 24, n. 620, pp. 294-296. In it we find written how “[Wright’s works] form the most important contributions which now chiefly engage the attention of the students of philosophy,” and further, how “it was only Mr. Wright’s neglect to preserve his thoughts in writing that prevented him”, citing John Fiske “from taking rank among the foremost philosophers of the nineteenth century.” In a letter of recommendation that William James wrote on Peirce’s behalf to Prof. Gilman of Chicago, dated November 25, 1875, he stated, “I don’t think it extravagant praise to say that of late years there has been no intellect in Cambridge of such general powers and originality as [Peirce], unless one should except the late Chauncey Wright, and effectively, Peirce will always rank higher than Wright” (James, Correspondence, Vol. 4).

a. Letters

Chauncey Wright maintained a lively and inspiring correspondence throughout his life. It is from these letters that we may approach his conversational genius. Thanks to his friend from childhood James Bradley Thayer, these were collected and privately printed in 1878.

Wright’s letters act as a primer, glossary, and journal to connect and clarify his published philosophical perspectives, while revealing the life and dialogue of one of the great pioneers in the history of early classical American philosophy of science, metaphysics, ethics and pedagogy. Although Wright mentioned that “letter-writing [was] still odious to [him]”, just two months before his death, he added, “I think it is, but so that the good of it, the Promethean endurance and philanthropy of it, is set off on high artistic principles against its evils, the vexatious stupidities of Cadmean invention” (Letters 344). It is through these letters, crafted to a high artistic principle that a study on Chauncey Wright begins in earnest, followed by his collected works in the volume entitled Philosophical Discussions (1877). This would, in the words of his friend William James (1842-1910), allow us to see “his tireless amiability, his beautiful modesty, his affectionate nature and freedom from egotism [and] his childlike simplicity in worldly affairs” (Ryan 2000:3, p. 4).

2. The Language and Philosophy of Science

For Wright, the philosophy of science as a general theory of the universe was not a main concern. He was actually a critic of such formulations and systems, a critic of anything that began to resemble metaphysical web-spinning, as seen in the works of Herbert Spencer (1820-1903). For Wright, science, or “true science”, does not base itself on any “principle of Authority” which would include principles which are linguistically construed to substitute for dogma and superstition. Science should not be a substitute system for the lost innocence of theological speculations, nor be tainted by a teleological nature. Wright believed “true science deals with nothing but questions of facts [which] if possible, shall not be determined beforehand [nor by] how we ought to feel about the facts … nor by moral biases” (Letters 113). As part of this position he was interested and critically tuned to the issues of “motives” that generated theories. As he wrote to F.E. Abbot, “no real fate or necessity is indeed manifested anywhere in the universe, only a phenomenal regularity” (Letters 111). Many years later, in 1932, Justice Oliver W. Holmes (1841-1935) recalls this point, stating Wright “taught me when young that I must not say necessary about the universe, that we don’t know whether anything is necessary or not. So I describe myself as a bettabilitarian. I believe we can bet on the behavior of the universe in its contact with us.” Much of Wright’s position and amicable critique of the theories of science (or attempts at being “scientific”) can be seen in his letters to F.E. Abbot (1836-1903), Mrs. Lesley and Miss Grace Norton, followed by the longer more technical articles collected in Philosophical Discussions, most notably “The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer”, “Evolution by Natural Selection”, “Evolution of Self-Consciousness”, “The Conflict of Studies”, and “A Fragment on Cause and Effect”. Many of Wright’s as-of-yet uncollected review articles also contain important statements regarding his critique of, and position on the philosophy of science. The study of these articles should clarify Wright’s non-partisan view of the use of science, his accommodation of what today we would call “complexity”, his care for precision in the use of terms and definitions employed in experimental methods, and his caution against the metaphysical adaptation of science that haunted many fanciful theories of the time. Wright was cautious in focusing on what he saw as the “two uses of language – the social and the meditative, or mnemonic”. Only in their strict exchange and study would a clear language for science become possible (“Evolution of Self-Consciousness”, in Philosophical Discussions 255). For Wright, without the developed power of primary perception and attention, the meditative use of language breeds nothing but trite metaphysical glossaries, a type of false memory (projected recollections), and ultimately vague and dogmatic principles product of a faulty, unchecked use of terms and definitions. Wright sought “scientific distinctness” over “moral connotations” (Letters 112). As he wrote to Miss Grace Norton (July 29, 1874), “we suffer from a mental indigestion. We have not solved the ambiguity of words” (Letters 275). Here, as the preeminent Wright scholar E. H. Madden stated, “the concept of substance [which Wright takes to task] arises from misleading metaphors in the syntax of language [and] is not unlike modern neo-Wittgensteinian analysis” (“Wright, James, and Radical Empiricism,” The Journal of Philosophy, LI, 1954, 871). The influence in the philosophy of language is due to in part to Nicholas St. John Green, a legal scholar, and in how Green believed that “a real definition is an analysis”. This was written during Green’s involvement with the Metaphysical Club.For Wright. Language is not, nor should be used as a “lying device”, which is a “false instinct in a rational being”, a drive to return to pre-linguistic “animal oblivion” which can be dressed up in the disdain for the science and clarity of terms as seen in the works of Herbert Spencer (1820-1903), and especially in those of the Rev. James Martineau (1805-1900). Wright called this type of philosophizing “poetry under the form of science, of which Hegelianism is the most notable modern epic” (Letters 179).

A compelling reflection on the question and power of language is seen in Wright’s letter to Charles Darwin (1809-1882), dated August 29, 1872 (Letters 240-246). With a clear use of terms and a sustained use of the nature of inference, Wright believed that we could extend, check, and use our knowledge of the study of nature as tools and extensions of careful perceptions. For Wright theoretical concepts should not be used as static summaries of truth, but as ever-active non-generalized “finders”. “Finders” are the use we make of working hypotheses through testable consequences open to future experiences. “Finders” are not hardened metaphysical concepts. They are speculative tools that may arise from experience, intuitions, dreams and imagination. For Wright the language and philosophy of science must be passed through the “tools of sensible experience”, not be concerned with “ontological pedigree or a priori character of a theory”, and above all search for the driving motives of research outside fear, respect and aspiration (Philosophical Discussions 47, 49).

For such an amiable and humble individual, Wright was a very tough-minded theorist. He cautions us to realize that the positivists stage of the Theological, Metaphysical and Scientific co-exist at every level and attempt of humankind’s quest for knowledge, as well as between rival hypotheses that seek to grasp culture and nature. Wright saw the space for a true scientific attitude based upon the methods of observation and the testing of rules of investigation, not in an endless cycle of collecting hypotheses for and against said methods, rules and facts. Wright clearly followed Bacon’s lead in severing “physical science from scholastic philosophy …” (Philosophical Discussions 375). In his words, “the conscious purpose of arriving at general facts and at an adequate statement of them in language, or of bringing particular facts under explicit general ones, determines for any knowledge a scientific character” (Philosophical Discussions 205). This character must always be what Wright called “useful knowledge”, and further, “with connection in phenomena which are susceptible of demonstration by inductive observation, and independent of diversities or resemblances in their hidden nature, or of any question about their metaphysical derivation, or dependence” (Philosophical Discussions 408).

From these considerations many twentieth-century commentators, with the exception of E.H. Madden, have marked Wright as a pragmatist, or proto-pragmatist. This is not precise, since for Wright, basic empirical propositions are not open to the idea of working hypothesis at the level of matter-of-fact experience common sense beliefs, nor are long-run results safe from teleological underpinnings. Further, these basic propositions are not prone to being tested by, nor serve as, criteria of meaning. Wright avoided offering a meaning of truth, and did not generalize on the nature of thinking (Letters 325).

Wright’s prefiguring of what later came to be known in 1897 as Jamesian pragmatism and Peirce’s more trenchant “pragmaticism,” can be best understood if one relates Wright to his legal minded friends and fellow members of the Metaphysical Club. This vigor of thought and stimulus to study was carried into and from the conversations at the Metaphysical Club due to the presence of the lawyers in the group: Holmes, St. John Green, Warner and Fiske. It was especially with Nicholas St. John Green, who also taught at Harvard Law School (1870-1873), and was an instructor in philosophy, that the shared use of Alexander Bain’s and J.S. Mill’s texts would have prompted conversation on the applicability of facts, actions and rights. This direction of thought is present in Green’s article “Proximate and Remote Causes”, from the American Law Review of 1870. With Green and Holmes, Wright also shared a closer bond of the care for precision in the use of language, and in the words of Green, “a frequent cause of perplexity in law is the loose way in which legal terms are used, the same term being used to express different things” (Green, Essays and Notes on the Law of Torts and Crime, p. 146). A similar position on this precision in the use of language can be seen between Oliver Wendell Holmes and Wright and in how Holmes saw law as a study of “prediction, the prediction of the incidence of the public force through the instrumentality of the courts” (Holmes, Collected Legal Papers, 167). This was Holmes’ position from as early as 1871. Soon after that C.S. Peirce gave a talk at the Metaphysical Club, (November 1872) where he wished to pool the many conversations and ideas. Six year later, and two years after Wright’s death, Peirce published two versions of this talk as the articles, “The Fixation of Belief”, and “How to Make Our Ideas Clear.”

a. Mathematics and Adequate Nomenclature

Wright published ten articles in the field of mathematics. According to his friend and fellow mathematician Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914), Wright was a “thorough mathematician” (Ryan 2000: 188). This was indeed high praise coming from C.S. Peirce who was the son of Prof. Benjamin Peirce (1809-1880), the great American mathematician of the nineteenth century and teacher of Wright at Harvard between 1848 and 1852. Prof. Benjamin Peirce also publicly praised Wright at one of his lectures, and the modest student never appeared in class after that lecture (Letters 122). There is no doubt that Wright was influence by Prof. Peirce’s view of mathematics as the supreme science, a science that, in Peirce’s words “draws necessary conclusions.” Wright even defended Benjamin Peirce in an article left unsigned in The Nation, entitled “Mathematics in Court” (September 19, 1867).

Wright’s talent for mathematics was seen early on in his years at the High School and Select High School in Northampton, MA, and at Harvard College, where he took the elective in mathematics in his junior year. His essay on “Ancient Geometry” was mentioned in the 1852 Commencement Program. Wright continually strove for the precision of terms and form which he found so clearly present in mathematics. In a letter dated October 1864, (most likely to F.E. Abbot) he stated that “mathematician are the most exacting of purists, since, having none but perfectly adequate nomenclature, they are intolerant of, and, as one may confess, also insensible to any thought not set forth in exact form.” In Wright’s substantial review article entitled “The Conflict of Studies” (Philosophical Discussions 267-295), one may explore Wright’s perspective on the use and abuse of mathematics and its teaching. We find how Wright championed the imaginative use of memory, a training that would loosen it from the shackles of projected route memorization. Wright’s coupling of mathematics and pedagogical techniques with the recreational are telling. It is here that his influence on friends must have been most powerful, because he believed that play is a useful character or drive that overcomes the repetitive and droll “irksome exercises”. An example of this exchange exists in a letter written by C.S. Peirce to Wright dated September 2, 1865 found at the American Philosophical Society in Philadelphia, PA. Peirce’s letters explains three card tricks, fully described and then explained by mathematical calculus. This, one quickly realizes is how mathematical genius is seen at play, and how such exuberance was transformed into high-level critique and discussion. It is unfortunate that Wright’s response is lost to us.

The earliest of the mathematical works of Wright is on “The Prismoidal Formula” (The Mathematical Monthly, October, 1858). In April 1859 he published the article “The Most Thorough Uniform Distribution of Points About an Axis”, a study of the form of distributions found in the arrangement of leaves around their stem (Phyllotaxis). In October of 1871, in Memoirs of the American Academy of Arts and Sciences, Wright published a more complete study of this problem entitled “The Uses and Origin of the Arrangement of Leaves in Plants”. Posthumously, and due to the influence of Prof. Asa Gray (a former professor of his of natural history at Harvard College) Wright’s study “A Popular Explanation (for those who understand Botany) of the Mathematical Nature of Phyllotaxis” was published in the American Naturalist (June 1876). Mention of these studies, as well as a wonderful summary for those who are not very familiar with botany or mathematics, are included in a letter dated August 1, 1871 to Charles Darwin, who expressed much interest in Wright’s studies on phyllotaxis (Letters 232-233). In June of the same year, he wrote an article on “The Economy and Symmetry of the Honey-Bee’s cells” for The Mathematical Monthly where he analyses the geometrical properties of the hive-cell, which as excavation and structures share the angles of the plane of 120 degrees, or four-thirds of a right angle to any other. These aforementioned articles conclude Wright’s contributions to The Mathematical Monthly.

In April 1864, Wright reviewed Prof. Chauvenet’s text “A Manual of Spherical and Practical Astronomy” for the North American Review, which he praises as a welcomed text for students in astronomical observation and calculation, replete with a history of the science, adding also praise for Chauvenet’s work on Spherical trigonometry, the problem of Eclipses, Occultations, and the numerical method of dealing with the values of observed quantities. Wright was always conscious of how his desire for precise terms and definitions became strained when, as a mathematician, he found himself out of his element (Letters 67). He left us a remarkable statement on this danger, from a letter to Miss Grace Norton dated January 1874, which is worth quoting in full. “There is ease and ease – two kinds – in understanding [with the degree of precision which analytic habits of thought demand]. Mathematics is easy in one way, - cannot be misunderstood, except by gross carelessness; is no more vague than a boulder; is either out of, or in, the mind entirely. To make progress among a heap of boulders is, you know, far from easy, in one way; but it is easier than walking on water, or than clearing the rough ground by flight. It is easy to dream of making such a flight, and to have every thing else in our dream as rational as real things; and it is easy to be actually carried on the made ways of familiar phraseology over difficulties which we are interested in only as a picturesque under-view, but which do not tempt us to explore them with the chemist’s reagents, the mineralogist’s tests, or the geologist’s hammer” (Letters 254). In this short statement we may gauge Chauncey Wright’s philosophical position, and his main line of critique against metaphysics, theology, and fanciful system building, which strove as was previously mentioned, to “turn[ ] history into mythology, and science into mythic cosmology” (Ryan 2000:3, p. 61).

b. Cosmology as “Cosmic Weather”

Wright’s interest and writings on cosmology are an excellent example of his approach to the problems of philosophical speculation and scientific research. The tension between these areas of study is nowhere clearer than in these writings. From these meditations, Wright coined the metaphor “cosmic weather”, a most apt term to reveal the continual presence of irregularities as product of the causal complexity, mixture of law and accident in the continual production of natural and physical causes unhinged from a teleological framework and continually prone to what he called “counter-movements” – or the action and counter-action and cycles of convertible and reversible mechanical energy. For Wright, “the physical laws of nature are … the only real type of the general order in the universe … showing at every turn the ultimate play of action and counter-action in the balanced forces from which they spring” (Letters 177). These reflections are also revealed in Wright’s conceptual patience and theoretical doubts on issues seemingly complex, for instance, the nature of volitional determinations and human actions which he believed were also product of the law of causation, but more embroiled with metaphors of “good” and “evil,” which raise the level of ambiguity by the increased reliance on metaphorical characters. For Wright “it is easy to be actually carried on the made ways of familiar phraseology over difficulties which we are interested in only as a picturesque under-view, but which do not tempt us to explore them with the chemist’s reagents, the mineralogist’s tests, or the geologist’s hammer” (Letters 254). Wright uses the difficulty of predicting the weather to focus the problem that “we do not hope to predict the weather with certainty, though this is probably a much simpler problem [than those of ethics, metaphysics, and theology]” (Letters 74). For Wright, phenomena, from the simplest organism to the grander phenomena of the universe, find observational repose in the complex connections of the law of evolution (non-teleologically construed), freed from the metaphorical disputes of faith, morality, and metaphysics. For a view of Wright’s position on this, and on the principle of “counter-movements” his article “A Physical Theory of the Universe” in Philosophical Discussions, serves as a prime example. Wright’s position is further clarified in his article “The Genesis of Species”, where he writes, “the very hope of experimental philosophy, its expectation of constructing the science into a true philosophy of nature, is based on the induction, or, if you please, the a priori presumption, that physical causation is universal; that the constitution of nature is written in its actual manifestations, and needs only to be deciphered by experimental and inductive research; that it is not a latent invisible writing, to be brought out by the magic of mental anticipation or metaphysical meditation” (Philosophical Discussions 131). Wright’s use of “weather” was picked up by William James in The Will to Believe (1896), for which his friend C.A. Strong wrote on November 12, 1905, “if external happenings are weather, then internal happenings … are so too, and they maintain themselves not primarily because they are true but because they are useful” (James, Correspondence, 2003: 11).

Contained in Philosophical Discussions there are three major reflections on the issue of cosmology and a true philosophy of nature, “A Physical Theory of the Universe” (July 1864), “Speculative Dynamics” (June 1875), and “A Fragment on Cause and Effect” (1873). In Wright’s uncollected articles, one may also profit from reading “The Winds and the Weather” (The Nation, January 1858), “Ennis on the Origin of the Stars” (The Nation, March, 1867), “The Correlation and Conservation of Gravitation and Heat, and the some of the effect of these Forces on the Solar System” (North American Review, July 1867), and “The Positive Philosophy” (North American Review, January 1868).

From Wright’s earliest piece, “The Winds and the Weather” (1858), an essay-review of three texts, he states that “the study of climates is … the first step towards the solution of the problem of the weather”, yet, he adds “the weather makes the most reckless excursions from its averages…” Weather is nothing but the “perturbations of climate” where one must track the periodic and prevailing winds, a first feature of regularity noticed by Halley as trade-winds, and product of the “unequal distribution of the sun’s heat in different latitudes”. Where Wright’s forward looking view of cosmology enters his review-essay is when he notes the “disturbing [second-order] accidents”, namely, “effects of the distributions themselves upon the action of the disturbing agencies.” As part of the idea of “counter-movements”, Wright believes that “some of the outward changes of nature are regular and periodic, while others without law or method, are apparently adapted by their diversity to draw out the unlimited capacities and varieties of life … as organic nature approaches a regulated confusion, the more it tends to bring forth that perfect order, of which fragments appear in the incomplete system of actual organic life.” In a similar vein, Wright saw the vast expanse of the nebulae and stars, in the “operations of secondary causes” that works with, yet as a check on, the simplistic theory of spiritualistic cosmic evolution most always prefaced by the ever deceptive yet charming metaphor: “In the beginning….”

In “Ennis on the Origin of the Stars” (The Nation, March 1867), Wright questions the facile understanding of the “law of motion” and the misstep of writers in seeking the origin of such laws from the nebular hypothesis and the interaction of its parts; a fault, he believes, of the author’s failure to employ previous accomplishments in the history of science. This is a similar criticism he leveled against Ethan Chapin’s “The Correlation and Conservation of Gravitation and Heat” (North American Review, 1867). This reveals Wright’s belief in the “guidance of results already reached”, which would eliminate the many false moves in “retracing our steps, and remodeling our fundamental ideas”. Upon the path of results already reached, Wright would add that “no one is bound to maintain any hypotheses to the exclusion of any other, until it is proved to be true”, and as part of his principle of “counter-movements” adds that “enlightened faith … does not demand as the condition of assent the force of irresistible demonstration, nor does it deceive itself with fallacious arguments” (“The Positive Philosophy” in North American Review, January 1868). In Wright’s review of Fendler’s “The Mechanism of the Universe and its Primary Effort-exerting Powers” (The Nation, June 1875), we find a more sustained criticism of the abuse of nomenclatures when mathematical definitions are allowed to slide into speculative metaphysics. These processes, as Wright mentions in “A Fragment on Cause and Effect” (1873) are always “causes [as] a continuation of conditions, or a concurrence of things, relations and events.” Throughout his writings on cosmology, Wright maintained a healthy tension with his non-developmental, ateleological view of “counter-movements”. It was no doubt a source of conceptual worry for the builders of philosophical systems of the time, H. Spencer, J. McCosh, F. Bowen, F.E. Abbot, J. Fiske, and C.S. Peirce.

c. Evolution as Theory of Natural Selection

Of all the articles of Chauncey Wright we find the most sustained flow in his reflections on the structure of evolutionary thought, which he saw and defended as Darwin’s theory of natural selection, a theory stripped of any a priori grounds or teleological ends, and as an on-going cumulative use of experiment, observation and argument.

The essay articles that cover Wright’s reflection on evolutionary theory are “Limits of Natural Selection”, “The Genesis of Species”, “Evolution by Natural Selection”, and “Evolution of Self-Consciousness”, all of which are collected in the volume Philosophical Discussions. An earlier article entitled “Natural Theology as a Positive Science” sets the stage for understanding Wright’s elimination of all religious dogmatism from the work of science, especially the latter’s misuse of final causes, ends, and intelligent design, which amount to the “theologian’s perversion of language.” “Evolution by Natural Selection” was a critique of the English Jesuit Naturalist George Mivart (1827-1900), which Wright had sent to Darwin on June 21, 1871, and which Darwin mentions and praises in The Descent of Man, stating that “nothing can be clearer than the way in which you discuss the permanence and fixity of species” (Letters 230-231). The article “Genesis of Species” was so admired by Darwin that he took it upon himself to publish it in England. Darwin wrote, “Will you provisionally give me permission to reprint your article as a pamphlet?” In a following letter Darwin added “I have been looking over your review again; and it seems to me and others so excellent that, if I receive your permission, with a title, I will republish it, notwithstanding that I am afraid pamphlets on literary or scientific subjects never will sell in England” (Letters 231). Together with these studies, Wright also provided us with two brief book notices, one entitled, “Books Relating to the Theory of Evolution” (The Nation, February, 1875), which serves as a primer to the literature surrounding the “unsurpassable quality” of Darwin’s 1872 edition of The Origin of Species. In the words of Wright’s friend James Bradley Thayer, “Darwin was a thinker who fairly drew from [Wright] an unbounded homage; and this lasted till his death; I never heard him speak of any one with such ardor of praise” (Letters 30). Wright met Charles Darwin in London on September 5, 1872 (Letters 246-247), and exchanged many letters with Darwin, the most revealing written on August 29, 1872, September 3, 1874, and February 24, 1875 (Letters 240-246, 304-318, 331-338).

3. Theory of Knowledge

None of Wright’s essays or reviews contains a full account of his theory of knowledge (epistemology). Wright did not generalize on the nature of thinking or on cosmology as generalized evolution. One can see his theory of knowledge as weighing in on the side of an empirical view, one that must be tested towards more precise types of verification, and at all costs avoiding any metaphysical trapping of “origins”. In combining his letters and the mention of the problems of knowledge throughout his published articles, one may gain a picture of his leaning towards empirical verification, that is, where beliefs are continually tested by shared concrete experiences. A primer to Wright’s view of the problems of knowledge and its shifts from ancient to modern science is seen in the first eleven pages of his 1865 article “The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer” (Philosophical Discussions 43-96). While verification is essential to scientific method, Wright believed that “there is still room for debate as to what constitutes verification in the various departments of philosophical inquiry” (Philosophical Discussions 45). Even as an empiricist, from but not blindly wedded to, the tradition of David Hume, Wright would not settle for an undisputed base of knowledge, but was more convinced that, in shared common experience (working hypotheses), and the study of how other individual perspectives interact, one would be allowed more profitable hypotheses. On this issue of hypotheses one must carefully follow what Wright says in reference to Darwin, that is, that he was “no more a maker of hypotheses than Newton was”, and that hypotheses have “no place in experimental philosophy” (Philosophical Discussions 136). For Wright, hypotheses are “trial questions … interrogations of nature; they are scaffolding which must be taken down as they are succeeded by the tests, the verifications of observation and experiment” (Philosophical Discussions 384).

A fairly detailed view of Wright’s position on the theory of knowledge is seen in his letter to F.E. Abbot, dated Oct 28, 1867 (Letters 123-135), where Wright argues that an “impression is cognized only when brought into consciousness”, and sees consciousness as a process of accumulated, shifting, and comparative laws. In “Limits of Natural Selection” (October, 1870), Wright states, “Matter and mind co-exist. There are no scientific principles by which either can be determined to be the cause of the other.” Consciousness is co-operative memory (or trained imagination), which interacts with the senses and works its laws as “grounds of expectation” (Letters 131). This allows Wright to circumvent both the closed question of the finality of knowledge, and the specter of relativism. While he believed in grounds, he was opposed to asserting and defending them dogmatically. Two important articles that touch on this through the mention of various theories are Wright’s “The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer” and “McCosh on Tyndall” in Philosophical Discussions 43-96 and 375-384. Wright also focuses on the “form of truth” (Letters 300), where accurate statements lead us to shared and testable accounts of knowledge. Wright mentions Socrates’ attitude, that “there is no merit in any really known truth, however sacred to any one, greater than clearness and adequacy of expression” (Letters 300), for “I wonder whether you get any adequate idea from [an] inadequate sentence” (Letters 270).

Another telling letter on issue and upshots of theories of knowledge is Wright’s letter to Miss Grace Norton dated August 12, 1874. There he writes, “… the human heart is a gallery of the future, illuminated by the light of its instincts and experience reflected from pictures and images of the future and the universal. As the repository and agency of all rationally conceived ends, it is the only rational final cause to itself, however serviceable it may be incidentally to other forms of life or living beings. The uses of other forms of life to the human are not final causes, though the uses of any forms of life to the universe would properly be final, if it were true that the universe is served by them in any other way than to make it up, or be among the threads that are woven in its endless combinations – its formal rather than its final causes” (Letters 292). Along with this telling vision, Wright also warns that “to demand the submission of the intellect to the mystery of the simplest and most elementary relation of cause and effect in phenomena, or the restraint of its inquisitiveness on reaching an ultimate law of nature, is asking too much, in that it is a superfluous demand”, and adds that “explanation cannot go, and does not rationally seek to go, beyond such facts [the connection of elements in phenomena] …” (“The Evolution of Self-Consciousness” in Philosophical Discussions 247).

“The Evolution of Self-Consciousness” (April, 1873) was Wright’s most accomplished study, and one personally prompted by Darwin, and the question of the links and differences in animal instinct and human intelligence. Wright called this field of study “pyschozoology”, where he set out to show how there was “no act of self-consciousness, however elementary [that] may have realized before man’s first self-conscious act in the animal world …” (Philosophical Discussions 200). In this study Wright was clearly opposed to any mysticism in theory or religious application, seeing how it leads to vagueness, and teleological assumptions. He instead focused on the difference in degree between the stimulus and use of signs in physical and phenomenal experience, a direct application of Darwin’s stimulus-response conception. Wright saw the desire to communicate in both animal and humans; though by degree, the animal’s activity grasps the “signs” without knowledge of the sign as a sign, thus relying on “outward attention” as the main support of its common-sense nature. Humans form “reflective attention”, that is, signs that are recognized and related to what they signify, both in past use and as projected future use. This is possible when signs are recognized and manipulated through memory able to distinguish between outward and inward signs, thus as “representative imaginations of objects and their relations [kinds]” (Philosophical Discussions 208). It is through this double attentiveness that the “germ of the distinctive human form of self-consciousness” was planted (Philosophical Discussions 210).

4. History of Philosophy

Wright was by no means a historian of philosophy in the tradition of those influenced and trained in Germany, as seen years later in the Harvard professor Josiah Royce (1855-1916). However, as a catalyst for the “Cambridge Septum Club” and the “Metaphysical Club” there were ample occasions throughout the meetings to mention figures and theories that pertained to the history of philosophy. As early as 1857, C. S. Peirce recalls how he would debate philosophy almost daily with Wright, and most regularly on the work of Mill (Menand 2001, 221, 477n.42). From what we have in Wright’s letters, figures from the history of philosophy were mostly focused upon a desire to point out, question, or resolve a conceptual problem or misgiving, rather than spin a narrative of historical schools and conceptual debts. As a case in point, and to show how Wright maintained a similar position throughout the areas of intellectual interest, it is worth pointing out that Wright, using a term in David Masson’s “Recent British Philosophy”, which he reviewed in 1866, believed that “the ontological passion” is “very nearly akin to what, in the modern sense of the word, is expressed by ‘dogmatism’ [which when coupled with] his [Masson’s] scheme of classification … discovers the relations between opinions of [the] philosophers [in question]” (Philosophical Discussions 344). It is clear that Wright would see any history of philosophy as a drive to classify prone to a motive of justification. The unfolding of the history of philosophy in itself was not a necessary technique for Wright, mostly due to his non-academic employment, yet also by the nature of his wide scope of interests, of which philosophy proper was but another tool and set of problems. One possible reason for this critical position and avoidance of such “histories” is that, for him, “the mythic instinct slips into the place of chronicles at every opportunity,” so much so that he claims, “all history is written on dramatic principle” (Philosophical Discussions 70-71). Wright was not prone to enchantment over explanation, and thus not susceptible to a philosophy of history as an inexorable philosophical progression. Yet, through his letters and the Philosophical Discussions, and in uncollected publications, he did mention many figures that make up a telling configuration of philosophers. As part of the configuration we find a portion of a reading list and Wright’s favorites beginning with Emerson, who he also heard lecture on the poets at Harvard, then Sir Henry Maine’s Ancient Law, Bacon’s Novum Organum, Whewell’s History of the Inductive Science, List’s, Political Economy, Hamilton’s Lectures on Metaphysics, Lectures on Logic, and Philosophy of the Conditioned, Mill’s Logic, and Examination of Sir William Hamilton, Alexander Bain, (on which Wright based his lectures on psychology at Harvard) and of course Darwin’s Origin of Species and the Descent of Man. Among the philosophers mentioned in his Letters, not including Wright’s contemporaries, one finds, Bacon, Bain, Fichte, Hamilton, Hegel, Kant, J.S. Mill, Occam, Plato, and by far with the most mentions, Socrates. With the addition of Aristotle, Locke, and Zeno, the mentions are fairly similar in his Philosophical Discussions.

The following citation could be read as Wright’s caution in approaching the history of philosophy as a meta-narrative, and as a critique of the undertow of a Hegelian brand of mythic history. “All cosmological speculations are strictly teleological. We never can comprehend the whole of a concrete series of events. What arrests our attention in it is what constitutes the parts of an order either real or dramatic, or are determined by interests which are spontaneous in human life. Our speculations about what we have not really observed, to which we supply order and most of the facts, are necessarily determined by some principle of order in our minds. Now the most general principle which we can have is this: that the concrete series shall be an intelligible series in its entirety; thus alone can it interest and attract our thoughts and arouse rational curiosity” (“The Philosophy of Herbert Spencer” in Philosophical Discussions 71). Wright’s sharpest critique of the metaphysical pretensions of order can be seen in his essay “German Darwinism” (September 9, 1875 in Philosophical Discussions 398-405).

It is likely that the most discussed critical position of Wright on the history of philosophy would have been a study not only of concepts and methods, but also motives. “The questions of philosophy proper are human desires and fears and aspirations – human emotions – taking an intellectual form” (Philosophical Discussions 50). This reveals Wright’s more sociological and psychological interest in the conditions for the pursuit of certain theories and methods over others. “We do not”, he wrote, “inquire what course has led to successful answers in science, but what motives have prompted the pertinent questions” (Philosophical Discussions 48). Further he adds, “philosophy proper should be classed with the Religions and with the Fine Arts, and estimated rather by the dignity of its motives, and the value it directs us to, than by the value of its own attainment” (Philosophical Discussions 52). This is again clearly stated in Wright’s review-essay “Lewes’s Problems of Life and Mind” in Philosophical Discussions, pages 366-368, where he mentions issues with “method” from Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Bacon, Leibniz, Locke and Newton. What Wright shows us is that “those who take the most active part in the philosophical discussions of their day have enlisted early in life in one or the other of two great schools [Platonic or Aristotelian], inspired predominately by one or the other of two distinct sets of philosophical motives, which we may characterize briefly as motives of defense in questioned sentiments, and motives of scientific or utilitarian inquisitiveness” (Philosophical Discussions 367).

For Wright, a history of philosophy would be an exacting engagement in discussion seeking to make the study of other minds part of the particular goods of human life, and as such would need to study how “philosophical stand-points” are but a parallax of previous doctrines (see Letters 124). Such a discursive history of philosophy (perhaps even “dialogical”) would require a “clearness and adequacy of expression” (Letters 300).

5. Pedagogy and the Philosophy of Education

Chauncey Wright’s “The Conflict of Studies” is a long review article of Isaac Todhunter’s (1820-1884) The Conflict of Studies, and Other Essays on Subjects connected with Education (1873). Todhunter was a mathematical lecturer at St. John’s College, Cambridge. The review appeared in The North American Review, July 1875, and is collected in Philosophical Discussions. Wright’s review was part of the ongoing debate on American educational reform during the mid-nineteenth century. Wright was privy to some of these changes, first as a student of Harvard College from 1848 to 1852, and then in 1870-1871 and 1874-1875 of Harvard’s early experiments in invited professional lecturers, under its then president and advocate of the Elective system, Charles W. Eliot.

Isaac Todhunter’s essay “The Conflict of Studies” notes the call for “useful knowledge” current in higher education, framing it as diffusion for and among the “humbler classes” (Todhunter 1873, 1). Todhunter, a conservative in the eyes of Wright, belongs to the line of Oxford and Cambridge masters who looked upon the growth of useful knowledge and the experimental sciences as inferior to what was taught at the ‘wealthy college or university”. Todhunter saw this difference reflected in the structures and rigor of competitive examinations, remarking that “we must not expect boys from the humbler classes to excel in the more expensive luxuries of education” (Todhunter, 1873, 21). Together with his marginalizing of the new experimental sciences, his dislike of the inclusion of any practical focus on the success or influence of mathematical study in practical life, and his disbelief in the powers of natural history or natural philosophy in raising a student’s attention to related pursuits, Todhunter stands in an opposite camp from Chauncey Wright. Wright responds to this with an insightful characterization of a letter of a young Union officer. “Command of the lower memory is doubtless improved by the mastery of some one or two subjects; the more special and narrow they are, the better, perhaps, for saving time, and even if they do not belong to what is commonly accounted essential to a liberal education. […] A young officer of the Union army in our late struggle, in a letter written on the evening before the battle in which his life was sacrificed, attributed his previous successes, and rapid promotion to responsible duties, to a six months’ study of turtles at the Zoölogical Museum of Harvard University, which was undertaken merely from the youthful instinct of mastery, or appreciation of the value of discipline, and was interrupted by the breaking out of the war and the young man’s enlistment in the service. Perhaps, however, the independence of character which determined this choice of means for discipline was the real source of the success which the youth too modestly attributed to the discipline itself” (Philosophical Discussions, 294).

The conflict of studies can be understood not only as the contrast between old curriculum and the more modern elective studies, but more profoundly as the conflict of the employment of types of memory, which Wright is clear in pointing out. “Writing and artificial memory are often, I think, in the way of a better sort of memory which holds what is worth retaining by more real ties” (Letters 201).

Wright unfolds what he considers to be aspects of a liberal education, and how a philosophy of mathematics can be re-employed towards a reform of general liberal education. The areas would be: i) the perfection of symbolism, ii) the use (applicability) of notation (symbols) to other sciences, iii) usefulness as the “objective ulterior value” of modern mathematics, and iv) where “useful knowledge” is that which is free from the mimicry of facts (cramming) and instead, focused on the moment of ‘selection” or the “utility of non-utilitarian motives.” For Wright, always cautious of his definitions, cramming is “a given amount of studious attention, either rational or merely mnemonic, given to a subject exclusively and for a short time” and this “gives the mind a different and a less persistent or valuable hold on the subject than the same amount and kind of attention spread over a longer time and interrupted by other pursuits” (Philosophical Discussions, 288). The focus on “selection” spread over a longer period of time, combines Wright’s evolutionary studies with the vision of keeping philosophy alive as the love of study, and as a “guest” not an “inmate” of the corporate spirit of the university or the “pittances of schoolmasters.”

Wright suggests a healthy dose of repetition, understood as a second mode of memory which would entail: i) the repeated acts of direct attention, (as repetition and intensity of impressions), ii) the repeated recalls or recollection, which has the variety of association, and repeated acts of voluntary recollection, or the active exercise of memory. This last mode needs “interposed intervals and diversions of attention,” which strengthen the more far-reaching constructive associations of thought (essential/rational), allowing the growth of reason. Such an understanding of the growth of reason and the re-tooling of the use of memory is directed against Todhunter’s idea that students should not question the statements of tutors, which for Wright entails shying away from appreciating evidence and learning from how experiments might also fail. Todhunter’s antiseptic vision of examinable experiments, where failure is seen as a static component, runs counter to the manifold processes involved in the love of study championed by Wright. “I venture to volunteer the advice that, in teaching philosophy, it is well to call in question and refute every thing you can, with the aid of collateral reading, in order that the young [students] may never forget that they are not studying their catechisms,--not merely studying to acquire true and settled doctrines, but mainly to strengthen their understanding, to learn to think, and doubt, and inquire with equanimity” (Letters 120).

Wright champions the “far-reaching constructive association of thought” (retentive memory), not as Todhunter believed, simple memory as exercised and practiced in the repetition of examinations as “temporary associations” (or recollection). The lower order of simple memory is not conducive to what Wright saw as the complex ends of study, that is, the “satisfaction of thought itself as a mental exercise.” What Wright grants as a testing of memory in conjunction with intuition, is raised by his example of the child’s memory of stories via contiguity and consecutiveness (retentiveness), versus a student’s memory for isolated facts in comparative mythology (recollection).

Wright suggests that the student be freed from the mere exercise of “simple memory” (or simple faith) by working with the “direct effect of illustrations … to aid the understanding and imagination,” which as part of the “ladder of the intellect” is made of the movement and counter-movements from the general to the particular, the abstract to the concrete and “to return again” (which includes the particular seen in the stages of experimental practices). “Only enough of discipline in the actual practice of experiments to enable the student to study his text-book intelligibly seems to us desirable for the purposes of a general education” (Philosophical Discussions 276).

Part of what this experimental practice entails is the use of what is recreational, that is, the fondness or love of study construed by a play-impulse. This is firmly opposed in Todhunter’s position. Instead, Wright (in Darwinian fashion) sees the aspect of the recreational (or re-associative) as what will have “habit to secure attractiveness,” where play is a useful character, or drive that overcomes the repetitive and droll “irksome exercises” (Letters 201).

The larger arena of debate, as Wright saw it, centered on the University’s duties to “mankind or to their several nations,” which entailed five related problems. The first is whether higher general university education should take on the form of a simple curriculum, or a variety of courses. The next problem must address the question of what constitutes a liberal education, which in turn will prompt the problem of the ends of a liberal education, which will lead to the fourth problem, that is, how these ends are to translate through a general education or specific studies found in lower school training. Wright’s perspective becomes clear in questioning the rather simplistic use of “ends,” geared, as he saw it, more by the “customs and institutions” within which the writers of reform (and the conservatives) are caught. Wright suggests that the problem of manifold ends requires a “scientific analysis of the experience,” which is a very sociological view. “It is quite true that the great qualities required and developed in philosophers by original research in experimental sciences are not product, or even approached, by the repetition of their experiments … Nevertheless we attribute much more value to a first-hand acquaintance with experimental processes than [Todhunter] appears to do. [Even] failures have in them an important general lesson, especially useful in correcting impressions and mental habits formed by too exclusive attention to abstract studies …” (Philosophical Discussions 274).

6. Recollections, Influence, and Critical Reception

A notice in the Hampshire Gazette, dated October 5, 1875, honoring Wright, mentions how his teacher at the Select High School from Northampton, Prof. David S. Sheldon “kindly and successfully suppressed [Wright’s rather deplorable early literary-poetic essays] and so it seems turned a very bad poet into a very great philosopher.” In Wright’s Letters J.B. Thayer, a classmate at Northampton High School shares what was reported in the notice, by yet another classmate, which describes how Prof. Sheldon “led all his pupils out into the fields and woods and taught them to observe the facts of nature, the life of plants and habits of birds, and insect, the movements of the heavenly bodies, the phenomena of the clouds …” Wright remembered this fondly, and in his Harvard College class-book of 1858 wrote of his inspired and zealous teacher and the specimens collected on these excursion through the wilds of Northampton. Though the collection has been lost, Wright retained the care and detail for these observations from Nature, especially seen in his letter to the daughter of Mr. Norton, Sara, dated September 1, 1875, eleven days before he died (Letters 353-354).

Wright was remembered with great affection by each of his friends, due to his good nature and talent for Socratic dialogue. Through the Letters this quality comes alive. A perceptive description of Wright’s person and style is found in John Fiske’s essay “Chauncey Wright” (Ryan 2000:3). Fiske writes, “his essays and review-article were pregnant with valuable suggestions, which he was wont to emphasize so slightly that their significance might easily pass unheeded; and such subtle suggestions made so large a part of his philosophical style that, if any of them chanced to be overlooked by the reader, the point and bearing of the entire argument was liable to be misapprehended.” Further he adds, “there was something almost touching in the endless patience with which he would strive in conversation to make abstruse matters clear to ordinary minds … [and] one of the most marked features of Mr. Wright’s style of thinking was his insuperable aversion to all forms of teleology … [and] more often he called himself a Lucretian [and] sharply attacked Anaxagoras for introducing creative design into the universe in order to bring coherence out of chaos. What need, he argued, to imagine a supernatural agency in order to get rid of primeval chaos, when we have no reason to believe that the primeval chaos ever had an existence save as a figment of the metaphysician!” In conclusion, Fiske wrote that “to have known such a man is an experience one cannot forget or outlive. To have had him pass away, leaving so scanty a record of what he had it in him to utter, is nothing less than a public calamity” (Ryan 2000:3, pp. 5-19).

William James also contributed a piece in The Nation upon Wright’s death, where he wrote that “Mr. Wright belonged to the precious band of genuine philosophers, and among them few can have been as completely disinterested as he. Add to this eminence his tireless amiability, his beautiful modesty, his affectionate nature and freedom from egotism, his childlike simplicity in worldly affairs, and we have the picture of a character of which his friends feel more than ever now the elevation and purity” (Ryan 2000:3, p. 4). Yet there was one mostly negative response to Wright from Borden Parker Bowne (1847-1910) written a few years after Wright’s death. It mostly defends his position against which Wright was critical, and seeking to place Wright in the camp of a crude empiricist. The article is of interest due to the effort to mention the history of philosophy with which Wright was engaged, and for which Prof. Bowne chides him for being anachronistic, lacking and narrow in historical study, and accuses him of being a mere critic, not a system-builder. If one adds to this Wright’s ateleological predisposition, his view of the belief in a God as confession of one’s speculative convictions and productions of education and experience, and in the possibility of irreligious morality, we gain part of the view of why his works were also difficult to place in the then budding neo-Hegelian religious system-builder of Classical American philosophy.

As the catalyst of the “Cambridge Septum Club” (1856, 1858, 1859), and especially for the “Metaphysical Club” (1872), Chauncey Wright was, as C.S. Peirce put it, the “intellectual boxing master”. As William James stated, Wright’s best work was “done in conversation; and in the acts and writing of the many friends he influenced, his spirit will, in one way or another, as the years roll on, be more operative than it ever was in direct production” (James in Ryan 2000: 1-2). As part of a splendid recollection of Wright as a modest, simple and well disposed friend, and as a “philosopher of the antique or Socratic type”, James’ tribute captures what Wright’s presence must have inspired. Where the perceptive and enthusiastic James overstated is in how Wright’s “acts and writing” would “be more operative than it ever was in direct production”. Apart from the few direct mentions in the works of William James in The Principles of Psychology (Preface), The Will to Believe, in Pragmatism, and once in his Letters, Wright was not made part of the emerging philosophical renaissance at Harvard.

There is a similarity in the immediate fate of Wright’s works, and those of C.S. Peirce, though the works and subsequent influence of Peirce in American philosophy was saved from oblivion thanks to the generosity of James and the care and philosophical and historical sensibility of Royce. The legacy of the works of Wright is owed to his friends J.B. Thayer, who collected his letters, and privately printed the volume in 1877, and his friend C. E. Norton, who collected his principle writings under the title Philosophical Discussions (1877). Yet, thirty-six review-articles remain in the journals within which Wright had published, from the years 1858 to 1876.

In a letter to William James, dated November 21, 1875, C.S. Peirce stated that “as to [Wright] being obscure and all that, he was as well known as a philosopher need desire. It is only when a philosopher has something very elementary to say that he seeks the great public or the great public him.” Peirce then adds, “I wish I was in Cambridge for one thing. I should like to have some talks about Wright and his ideas and see if we couldn’t get up a memorial for him. His memory deserves it for he did a great deal for every one of us [James, Peirce, Abbot]. Other of his friends, Gurney, Norton, Peter Lesley, Asa Gray etc., would be wanted to do the personal and other relations. But what I am thinking of [I don’t purpose anything] is to give some resume of his ideas and of the history of his thought” (James, The Correspondence of William James, Vol. 4. 1995: 523-524). These talks never happened.

While both Peirce and James acknowledged their personal debt to their “intellectual boxing master”, apart from a few mentions in their letters and in a few of James’ works, no directly cited conceptual links can be traced with scholarly confidence. While Charles Darwin was impressed by Wright’s work, and saw him as one of his clearest readers, the untimely death of Wright ended what could have been a more productive exchange. In Wright’s letters one finds that he possibly influenced Nicholas St. John Green in discussing the use of the terms “duty of belief”, (though reference to the author is not provided by Thayer). Wright believed that “duty of belief” means only those principles of conduct, and what follows from them, which recommend themselves to all rational beings or at least to all adult rational, human beings (Letters 342-343). One can imagine William James being present, and then adopting this critique years later for his text, The Will to Believe (1896). It was Nicholas St. John Green, as Max Fisch reports, that “urged the importance of applying Alexander Bain’s definition of belief as that upon which a man is prepared to act”, and continues, “from this definition, Peirce adds, pragmatism is scare more than a corollary” (Ryan 2000: 99, and 99n.28; 136). If C.S. Peirce was “disposed to think of [Bain] as the grandfather of pragmatism” (and either himself, or St. John Green as fathers), then perhaps, one may again refer to Chauncey Wright as pragmatism’s “uncle”, because Wright, more than anyone of his early fellow thinkers, worked under the guidance of the “instinctive attraction for living facts”, as Peirce once defined pragmatism (Ryan 2000: 136, 139).

7. References and Further Readings

a. Primary Sources

  • Wright, Chauncey, 1850-1875. Chauncey Wright Papers, American Philosophical Society.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1858. “The Winds and the Weather.” Atlantic Monthly Vol. 1 (January): pp. 272-279.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1971.Philosophical Discussions, ed. Charles Eliot Norton, (Henry Holt and Co., 1877), New York: Burt Franklin.
  • Wright, Chauncey, 1971a. Letters of Chauncey Wright, ed. James Bradley Thayer, (Cambridge 1878), New York: Burt Franklin.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, Katharine, 2005. Predicting the Weather: Victorians and the Science of Meteorology, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Chambliss, J.J., 1960. “Natural Selection and Utilitarian Ethics in Chauncey Wright”, American Quarterly, 12, pp. 145-152.
  • Chambliss, J.J., 1964. “Chauncey Wright’s Enduring Naturalism”, American Quarterly, 16, pp. 628-635.
  • Clendenning, John, 1985. The Life and Thought of Josiah Royce, Wisconsin: The University of Wisconsin Press.
  • Cohen, Felix, S. 1962. American Thought: A Critical Sketch. New York: Collier Books.
  • Croce, P. J., 1998. Science and Religion in the Era of William James: Eclipse of Certainty, 1820-1880,
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1909. Education for Efficiency and The New Definition of the Cultivated Man, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1913.The Tendency to the Concrete and Practical in Modern Education, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1924.Late Harvest: Miscellaneous Papers Written between Eighty and Ninety, Boston: The Atlantic Monthly Press.
  • Eliot, Charles W., 1969.Educational Reform, New York: Arno Press.
  • Fisch, M.H., 1942. “Justice Holmes, the Prediction Theory of Law and Pragmatism”, The Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 39, No. 4 (February 12), pp. 85-97.
  • Fiske, John, 1902. “Chauncey Wright” in Darwanism and Other Essays, Boston: Houghton, Mifflin andCompany.
  • Flower, Elizabeth, and Murphey, Murray, G., 1977, A History of Philosophy in America, Vol 2. New York: G.P. Putnam’s Sons.
  • Gardiner, John H., 1914. Harvard, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Giuffrida, Robert Jr., 1980. “Chauncey Wright and the Problem of Relations,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 16, No. 4 (Fall): pp. 293-308.
  • Giuffrida, Robert Jr., 1988. “The Philosophical Thought of Chauncey Wright: Edward Madden’s Contribution to Wright Scholarship,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 24, No. 1, (Winter): pp. 37-43.
  • Hawkins, Hugh, 1972. Between Harvard and America: The Educational Leadership of Charles W. Eliot, NewYork: Oxford University Press.
  • Hill, George B., 1895. Harvard College by an Oxonian, New York: Macmillan and Co.
  • Huler, Scott, 2004. Defining the Wind: The Beaufort Scale, and How a Nineteenth-Century Admiral Turned Science into Poetry, New York: Crown Publishers.
  • James. Henry, 1930. Charles W. Eliot: President of Harvard University 1869-1909, Vols. 1 and 2, Boston: Houghton Mifflin Company.
  • James, William, 1952. Principles of Psychology, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • James, William, 1975. Pragmatism, and The Meaning of Truth, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • James, William, 1992, 1995, 1999, 2000, 2003. The Correspondence of William James, Vols. 1, 4, 7, 8, 11, Edited by Ignas K. Skrupskelis and Elizabeth M. Berkeley, Charlottesville: University of Virginia Press.
  • Kuklick, Bruce, 1977. The Rise of American Philosophy: Cambridge, Massachusetts 1860-1930, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Kuklick, Bruce, 2001. A History of Philosophy in America 1720-2000, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lowell, A. Lawrence, 1962. At War with Academic Traditions in America, Westport, Connecticut: Greenwood Press.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1955. “The Cambridge Septem,” Harvard Alumni Bulletin, LVII, (January): 310-315.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1958.The Philosophical Writings of Chauncey Wright: Representative Selections, New York: The Liberal Arts Press.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1963.Chauncey Wright and the Foundations of Pragmatism, Seattle: University of Washington Press.
  • Madden, Edward H., 1972. “Chauncey Wright and the Concept of the Given,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 8, No. 1 (Winter): 48-52.
  • Madden, Edward H., 2000.Introduction, Influence and Legacy, Vol.3 The Evolutionary Philosophy of Chauncey Wright, Frank X. Ryan, (ed.) London: Thoemmes Press.
  • Menand, Louis, 2001. The Metaphysical Club: A Story of Ideas in America, New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux.
  • Morison, Samuel E., 1937. Three Centuries of Harvard (1636-1936), Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Perry, Ralph B., 1935. The Thought and Character of William James, Boston: Little Brown and Company.
  • Privitello, Lucio A., 2005. “Introducing the Philosophy of Education and Pedagogy of Chauncey Wright,” Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society, Vol. 41, No. 3 (Summer): 627-649.
  • Ryan, Frank X. (ed.), 2000. The Evolutionary Philosophy of Chauncey Wright, 3 vols. London: Thoemmes Press.
  • Santayana, George, 1944. Persons and Places, New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons.
  • Schneider, Herbert W., 1946. A History of American Philosophy, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Sini, Carlo, 1972. Il Pragmatismo Americano, Bari: Editori Laterza.
  • Thelin, John, R. 2004. A History of American Higher Education, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Todhunter, Isaac, 1873. The Conflict of Studies and Other Essays on Subjects connected with Education, London: Macmillian and Co.
  • White, Morton, 1972. Science and Sentiment in America: Philosophical Thought from Jonathan Edwards to John Dewey, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Wiener, Philip P. 1948, “The Pragmatic Legal Philosophy of N. St. John Green (1830-76)”, Journal of the History of Ideas, Vol. 9, No. 1, pp. 70-92.

Author Information

Lucio Angelo Privitello
Richard Stockton
College of New Jersey
U. S. A.

Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130—1200)

Zhu_xiA preeminent scholar, classicist and a first-rate analytic and synthetic thinker, Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi) created the supreme synthesis of Song-Ming dynasty (960-1628 CE) Neo-Confucianism. Moreover, by selecting the essential classical Confucian texts--the Analects (Lunyu) of Confucius, the Book of Mencius (Mengzi, the Great Learning (Daxue) and the Doctrine of the Mean (Zhongyong)—then editing and compiling them, with commentary, as the Four Books (Sishu). In doing so, Zhu redefined the Confucian tradition and outlook. He restored its original focus on moral cultivation and realization from the more bureaucratic stance of Confucians of the preceding Han and Tang dynasty (206 BCE-905 CE) who concentrated on the Five Classics (Wujing) of classical antiquity. The Four Books became required reading for the imperial examination system from the Yuan dynasty (1280-1341) until the system was abolished near the end of the Qing dynasty (1644-1911) in 1908. In his philosophical work, Zhu fused the concepts of the principal Northern Song (960-1126 CE) thinkers, Shao Yong (1011-77), Zhou Dunyi (1017-73), Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020-77) and the brothers Cheng Yi (1033-1107) and Cheng Hao (1032-85) into a rich, grand synthesis. Zhu Xi's thought has been the starting point for intellectual discourse and the focus of disputation for the last 800 years. His influence spread to Korea and Japan, which adopted Confucianism and the imperial examination system and were enamored of Zhu's intellectual achievements. To study traditional Chinese philosophy, especially Confucian thought, one must engage the ideas and works of Zhu Xi.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Philosophy of Human Nature and Approach to Self-Cultivation
  3. Moral Cosmic Synthesis
  4. Metaphysical Synthesis
  5. Key Interpreters of Zhu Xi
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Zhu Xi was born in Youqi in Fujian province, China in 1130. A precocious child, he asked what lay beyond Heaven at age five and grasped the import of the Classic of Filiality (Xiaojing) at age eight. After losing his father, Zhu Song (1097-1143), in his youth, he was raised in the company of several eclectic scholars, including Buddhists. A prodigy, he passed the top-level jinshi exam (the “presented scholar” exam) at the young age of nineteen, drawing on Chan Buddhist notions in his answers. He continued to nurture an eclectic interest in Daoism and Buddhism until he became the student of the Neo-Confucian master Li Tong (1093-1163) in 1160. Zhu’s father had recommended that he study under Li, but Zhu delayed seeing him until age 30, when he had spiritual doubts. A master in the tradition of the Cheng brothers, Li convinced Zhu of the superiority of the Confucian Way and cultivation, to which Zhu devoted himself for the next forty years. Having passed the jinshi examination, Zhu was qualified to hold office and was assigned to several prefectural administrative posts. But Zhu was critical of central court policy on several key issues and preferred temple guardianships, which gave him leisure to read, write and teach. (This also shielded him from the cutthroat politics at court where his frankness would have been literally fatal to him.) He thus became a productive scholar who made lasting contributions to classicism, historiography, literary criticism and philosophy. He was also a master of elegant prose and poetry.

As a renowned teacher, Zhu taught the classics and Neo-Confucianism to hundreds, if not thousands, of students. His oral teachings are preserved in the Classified Dialogues of Master Zhu (Zhuzi yulei). He also published critical, annotated editions of several classics, including the Book of Change (Yijing) and the Book of Odes (Shijing), of specific Neo-Confucianism works, including the works of Zhou Dunyi, Zhang Zai and the Cheng brothers, and a more encompassing Neo-Confucian anthology, Reflections on Things at Hand (Jinsi lu). Devoted to his work, he kept busy virtually to his last breath when he was rethinking and discussing the Great Learning. Throughout life, he sought to reestablish the fundamental principles and ideals of Confucianism in order to restore the vitality of China’s cultural and political integrity as a Confucian society, since those seeking spiritual guidance and solace were inclined to favor Daoism and Buddhism over the spiritually impoverished alternative of bureaucratic Confucianism. Moreover, he thought the empire needed the spiritual élan of authentic Confucian values to meet the challenge of barbarian encroachers. His patriotism, commitment to the tradition and devotion to scholarship and education remain an inspiration to this day in East Asia and throughout the world.

2. Philosophy of Human Nature and Approach to Self-Cultivation

Zhu's complex theory of human nature registered the possibility of evil as well as that of sagehood. On his theory, while (following Mencius, 372-289 BCE) people are fundamentally good (that is, originally sensitive and well-disposed), how one manifests this original nature will be conditioned by one's specificqi endowment (one's native talents and gifts), and one's family and social environment. These together yield one's empirical personality, intelligence and potential for cultivation and success. Zhu thought difference in individual disposition, character and aptitude for moral self-realization are due to variations inqi endowments and environments.

Preceding generations of Neo-Confucian scholars had tended not to register the complexity of human nature and the wide range of individual differences and advocated relatively straightforward approaches to self-cultivation as purifying the mind to elicit the natural responses of one’s original goodness. They tended to understand this process in itself to constitute self-realization. For example, Zhu's teacher Li Tong had strongly advocated a form of meditation called "quiet sitting," the efficacy of which the active young Zhu had doubted from the outset, at least for himself. Several years later, Zhu held discussions with Zhang Shi (1133-80), a follower of Hu Hong (1106-61), who had advocated “introspection in action.” Zhu initially embraced this approach, but soon found that it was not viable for himself. He found that such introspection in the heat of action could not inform or guide action. It tended to impede the flow of effective deliberate action by making one too self-conscious.

Zhu Xi's ingenious solution was a two-pronged approach to cultivation that involved nurturing one's feeling of reverence (jing) while investigating things to discern their defining patterns (li). Reverence, a virtue taught by Confucius (551-479 BCE) and the classics, serves to purify the mind, attune one to the promptings of the original good nature and impel one to act with appropriateness (yi). At the same time, by grasping the defining, interactive patterns that constitute the world, society, people and upright conduct, one gains the key to acting appropriately. The mind that is imbued with a feeling of reverence and comprehends these patterns will develop into a good will (zhuzai) dedicated to rectitude and appropriate conduct.

Interestingly, in later life, Zhu regarded this conception of cultivation and realization as too complicated, gradual and difficult to complete. Like Confucius, he came to accept that one must, on embarking on moral self-cultivation, establish the resolve (lizhi) to realize the Confucian virtues and become an exemplary person (junzi), a master of appropriateness in human conduct and interpersonal affairs.

3. Moral Cosmic Synthesis

In "A Treatise on Humanity" (Renshuo), Zhu Xi articulates and systematizes the classical Confucian ideal of humanity (ren) in simultaneously cosmic and human perspective. At the same time, he effectively criticizes competing accounts of "humanity" on logical, semantic and ethical grounds. Following early tradition, Zhu associates humanity with cosmic creativity. At its root, humanity is the impulse of "heaven and earth" (the cosmos) to produce things. It is manifested vividly in the cycle of seasons and the fecundity of nature. (The settled Chinese terrain and climate were moderate and productive, supporting the view that nature generally was fecund and afforded suitable conditions for human flourishing.) This impulse to produce is instilled in all of the myriad creatures, but in man it is sublimated into the virtue of “humanity” ("authoritative personhood"), which, when fully realized, involves being caring and responsible to others in due degree. Zhu Xi similarly correlates the four stages of creativity and production in the cosmos and nature -- origination, growth, flourishing and firmness -- that were first indicated in the Book of Change, with the four cardinal virtues enunciated by Confucius -- humanity, appropriateness, ritual conduct and wisdom. He thus portrays the realized person as both a vital participant in cosmic creativity and a catalyst for the flourishing and self-realization of others. On this basis, Zhu goes on to formulate the definitive definition of ren (humanity, authoritative personhood) for the subsequent tradition: "the essential character of mind" and "the essential pattern of love." The virtue of ren grounds the disposition of mind as commiserative and describes the core of moral self-realization as love for others (other-directed concern), appropriately manifested.

4. Metaphysical Synthesis

Zhu Xi erected a metaphysical synthesis that has been compared broadly to the systems of PlatoAristotleThomas Aquinas and Whitehead. These “Great Chain” systems are hierarchical and rooted in the distinction between form and matter. Zhu advanced Zhou Dunyi's dynamic conception of reality as shown in the "Diagram of the Supreme Polarity" (Taiji tu), in order to conceive the Cheng brother's concept of li (pattern, principle) and Zhang Zai's notion of qi (cosmic vapor) as organically integrated in a holistic system. In Zhou's treatise, Explanation of the Diagram of the Supreme Polarity (Taiji tu shuo), Zhu discerned a viable account of the formation of the world in stages from the original unformed qi, to yin and yang, the five phases -- earth, wood, fire, water and metal -- and on to heaven, earth and the ten thousand things. Zhu blended this conception with ideas from the Book of Change and its commentaries in setting forth a comprehensive philosophy of cosmic and human creativity, providing philosophical grounds for the received Confucian concepts of human nature and self-cultivation. Zhu's penchant for thinking in polarities—li and qi, in particular—has continued to stir critics to regard him as a dualist who used two concepts to explain reality. For his part, any viable account of the complexity of phenomena must involve two or more facets in order to register their complexity and changes.

5. Key Interpreters of Zhu Xi

Zhu Xi was an active scholar-intellectual who held discussions and disputes with other scholars, both in correspondence and in person. He can be known by contrast with others as well as through his positive views. For example, his series of letters with Zhang Shi on the topic of self-cultivation, preserved in theCollected Writings of Master Zhu (Zhuzi wenji), provides an enlightening record of these dedicated Confucians’ quest for a well-grounded, effective approach to self-cultivation. He debated with Lu Zuqian (1134-1181) on the nature of education. Zhu focused on the Confucian Way and moral practice, while Lu argued for a broader-based humanities approach. He held a series of debates with Lu Jiuyuan (Xiangshan, 1139-93) on the nature of realization and moral conduct. Whereas Zhu advocated regimens of study, reflection, observation and practice, Lu spoke simply of reflecting on the self and clarifying the mind, considering that once the mind was clear one would know spontaneously what to do in any situation. Zhu also corresponded with the “utilitarian” Confucian scholar Chen Liang (1143-94), who disputed Zhu’s focus on individual moral realization and the received “Way” with a broader institutional approach that was more sensitive to empirical facts and conditions. Zhu generally eclipsed all of the other scholars of his day, partly because he outlived them and had so many students, but mainly because his system was so compelling. It was comprehensive yet nuanced, tightly reasoned yet accommodating of individual differences. It preserved the essential Confucian Way yet ramified it to meet the challenges of Buddhism and Daoism as spiritual teachings. Zhu’s influence rose at the end of the Southern Song dynasty and became decisive during the Yuan dynasty, which adopted his edition of the Four Books as the basis of the imperial examination system arranged by scholars trained in his approach.

While raising his standing in pedagogy, this focus on the Four Books at the expense of Zhu’s deeper, more nuanced texts and dialogues opened the door to philosophic criticism. A schematic presentation of Zhu’s cosmic theory of pattern (li) and qi lay in the background of his commentary to the Four Books, which easily opened him to charges of dualism and of reading abstract categories into the essentially practical ancient texts. Because his commentary was focused on reading and understanding the meaning, intent and cultivation message of the Four Books, critics generalized that Zhu and his method were essentially scholastic and would be myopic and stilted in facing real situations. Anyone who peruses the corpus of Zhu’s writings and dialogues, however, will find that his ontology is not a crude dualism but a holism built of mutually implicative elements that never exist in separation. Also, his reflections are always informed by knowledge of history, current events and practical observation, as his method of observation applies generally to objects (and self) and phenomena while respecting but not privileging texts. Even his comments on Confucius and Mencius often refer back to the person and the speech context, and, thus, are not entirely scholastic. His method of observation opened the door to breakthroughs beyond the “verities” of the classics, though he was careful not to play up this fact because most of his colleagues sought the truth in the texts, thinking empirical facts were distractions from the essential Heavenly-patterning (tianli) reflected more adequately in the canonical texts.

Whereas early generations of Zhu’s followers were acquainted with his broader learning, style and spirit, Confucians of the Ming and Qing dynasties knew him mostly through his edition of the Four Books, through which they targeted their criticisms of his thought. Zhu’s most eminent critic was the Ming scholar-official Wang Yangming (Wang Yang-ming, 1472-1529). In youth, Wang had admired Zhu’s learning and once even attempted to try out his approach to observation, “investigate things to discern their defining patterns.” But, after diligently “observing” bamboo for several days, Wang became ill and got no special insight into the pattern or meaning of bamboo or anything else. He therefore rejected Zhu’s approach to observation as too objective, as outward rather than inward. In the twentieth century, Qian Mu observed that Zhu would only make such observations with guiding questions in mind, around which to focus his observations; he never would have countenanced just looking, which would turn up nothing that wasn’t obvious. For example, having heard a monk claim that bean sprouts grow faster by night than by day, Zhu measured the growth of some bean plants after twelve hours of daylight and of nocturnal darkness, respectively, and found that the plants exhibited the same rate of growth day and night. (The monk’s claim had been based on Mencius’ idea that the qi was more vital at night.) For his part, Wang transformed Zhu’s theory of observation into a pragmatic theory, thereby gearing observation directly to discernment and response—knowing how to act. Thus, Wang formulated a famous slogan that “knowledge and action form a unity.” Later, he argued that knowledge is not essentially objective and factual, but rooted in an inborn moral sensitivity (liangzhi), which is elicited by clarifying the mind so that one becomes actively responsive to one’s moral impulses (liangneng). It could be said that, in his criticisms, Wang was reacting more to the scholastic attitudes fostered by the examination system than to Zhu Xi himself. Wang ultimately respected Zhu and went on to compile a text attempting to show that in later life Zhu had changed his approach in a subjective, practical way that anticipated Wang’s approach.

Scholars of the late Ming through early Qing period (mid-seventeenth to early eighteenth century), notably, Wang Fuzhi (1619-92) and Dai Zhen (Tai Chen, 1723-77), disputed Zhu on philosophical and textual grounds. Whereas Zhu had insisted on the priority of “pattern” over qi, (roughly, form over matter), Wang and Dai followed the Northern Song thinker Zhang Zai in affirming the priority of qi, viewing patterns as a posteriori evolutionary realizations of qi interactions. They thought this account dissolved the threat of any hint of dualism in cosmology, ontology and human nature. For his part, Zhu Xi would have responded that, fundamentally, “pattern” is implicated in the very make-up and possible configurations of qi; which is why the regular a posteriori patterns can emerge. “Pattern” provides for the standing orders and processes, based on the steady interactions of yin-yang, five phases, etc., that give rise to the heaven-earth world order, with its full complement of ten thousand things. The fundamental a priori patterns are thus necessary to the world order and provide the fecund context in which the a posteriori forms emerge continuously. Wang and Dai’s qi-based view could not account for existence and the world order in this sense. At the same time, Zhu did not think that “patterns” were absolutely determinative. They just set certain “possibilities of order” that are realized when the necessary qiconditions obtain. For the most part, he registered the range of randomness and free flow in qi activity that is best exemplified in the randomness of weather systems and seismic events.

As to textual grounds, Wang and Dai argued that Zhu was so enamored of his metaphysics of pattern andqi that he constantly read them into the classical texts. For example, Dai said Zhu blandly associated Confucius’ term tian (heaven) with his own notion of li (pattern; principle), quoting Analects 11:9 where Confucius, in sorrow over the death of his disciple Yan Hui, cried that “Heaven had forsaken” him. Could Zhu reasonably claim that Confucius was crying that li had forsaken him? Critics tend to find Dai’s counter-intuitive example against Zhu’s approach compelling. However, consulting Zhu’s original commentary, we find that he noted that this phrase expressed Confucius’ utmost sorrow, that he felt Yan Hui’s death as if it was his own, without mentioning “pattern.” This example does not prove Wang and Dai’s claim. It illustrates that Zhu’s commentary was nuanced and sensitive to pragmatic, situational usages despite his penchant to see his own notion of “pattern” in some of Confucius’ usages of “heaven.” Moreover, the classicist Daniel Gardner shows that Zhu’s commentary was not intended as simply a glossary with comments. It was intended as a guide to self-cultivation. Hence, Zhu sometimes recast passages in the Analects more generally to show their broader implications for self-cultivation and realization, often with the isolated countryside student in mind. Gardner shows that Zhu thus had enriched the text as a vital tool for self-cultivation, whereas the earlier commentaries of the Han and Tang dynasties had just given glosses necessary for answering examination questions.

Known in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries in the West due to the work of Jesuits in China, Zhu Xi’s thought and texts were made more widely available to western scholarship in the late nineteenth century. Early in the twentieth century, a Chinese student of John Dewey (1859-1951) at Cornell, Hu Shi (1891-1962), initially followed the empirical, textual Qing scholars in viewing Zhu as a scholastic metaphysician. But, after reading Zhu’s Dialogues in old age, Hu contended that Zhu’s method of observation was not scholastic but essentially scientific in nature. J.C. Bruce, who translated a book of Zhu’s collected writings in the 1920s, viewed Zhu’s notion of li (pattern; principle) in light of Stoic natural law. From the 1930s, the eminent historian of Chinese philosophy, Feng Youlan, interpreted li along the lines of platonic Forms making Zhu Xi appear to be an idealist and abstract thinker. In the 1950s, Carsun Chang naturalized the notion of li by aligning it with the Aristotelian “nature” or “essence,” thereby locking Zhu’s thought into a sort of descriptive metaphysics.

From the 1960s, Mou Zongsan interpreted and criticized Zhu’s ontology and ethics on Kantian grounds, saying he erected an a priori framework but then illicitly sought to derive further a priori knowledge (of patterns) by a posteriori means (observation). In the 1970s, the intellectual historian, Qian Mu examined and explained Zhu Xi’s thought directly on its own terms, without reading western concepts and logical patterns into his system. Scholars wanting to read Zhu Xi on his own terms, unmediated by western thought, turn to the five volume Zhu Xi anthology edited by Qian Mu as a rich starting point.

In 1956, Joseph Needham, a scientist, made a highly significant breakthrough by interpreting Zhu’s system in terms of a process philosophy, Whitehead’s organic naturalism. Needham successfully recast much of Zhu’s language in naturalistic rather than metaphysical terms. The cultural, moral dimension of Needham’s account has been developed by Cheng-ying Cheng and John Berthrong, while the scientific dimension has been examined by Yung Sik Kim. In the 1980s, A.C. Graham offered the most insightful and apt account of Zhu’s terminology and pattern of thought in, “What Was New in the Ch’eng-Chu Theory of Human Nature?” and other writings. Graham showed decisively that the term li refers to an embedded contextual “pattern,” rather than to any sort of abstract form or principle. He reminded us that the term li never figures in propositions or logical sequences, as would be natural for “principle.” Rather,li are always conceived as structuring, balancing, modulating, guiding phenomena, processes, reflection and human discernment and response. For example, one never finds moral syllogisms in Zhu Xi’s writings. Everything he says is about moral emotional intelligence: attunement, sensitivity, discernment, and response. Kirill Thompson has explored and extended Graham’s interpretation in a series of studies. Joseph Adler examines the roles played by the Book of Change and Zhou Dunyi in Zhu’s thought, while Thomas Wilson and Hoyt Tillman have shown the extent to which Zhu Xi re-visioned, revised and recast the Confucian Way. Wilson is interested in Zhu’s account of the Way as a sort of educational-ideological revision, and Tillman is interested in how Zhu’s account of the Way eventually snuffed out other competing versions that might have offered more practical and liberal openings in late imperial China.

In summary, the depth and range of Zhu Xi’s thought were unparalleled in the tradition. Zhu Xi studies continue to be vital, wide-ranging and contentious, drawing growing global, cross-cultural interest.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adler, Joseph (1998). “Response and Responsibility: Chou Tun-I and Confucian Resources for Environmental Ethics” in Mary Tucker and John Berthrong ed. Confucianism and Ecology: The Interpretation of Heaven, Earth, and Humans, Cambridge: Harvard UP.
    • Expansion and application of Zhou Tunyi and Zhu Xi’s ideas to frame a cogent environmental ethic. Clear and thoughtful.
  • (1999). “Chu Hsi’s Use of the I ching” in Kidder Smith, ed., Sung Dynasty Uses of the I ching, Princeton: Princeton UP.
    • Readable and informative survey. Complements the following text.
  • (2002). “Introduction to the Classic of Change” by Chu Hsi: Translation with introduction and notes, Provo: Global Scholarly Publications.
    • Zhu Xi’s guide to understanding and using the Book of Change. Fascinating. Clear translation and commentary. A major contribution to Zhu Xi and Book of Change studies.
  • Berthrong, John H. (1994). Concerning Creativity: A Comparison of Chu Hsi, Whitehead, and Neville, Albany: SUNY Press.
    • Well-developed “process philosophy” interpretation of Zhu’s speculative thought; see Needham 1956a and 1956b.
  • Bruce, J. Percy (1923). Chu Hsi and His Masters: An Introduction to the Sung School of Chinese Philosophy, London: Probsthain.
    • Pioneering historical study.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit (1963). “The Great Synthesis in Chu Hsi,” in A Source Book In Chinese Philosophy,Princeton: Princeton UP, 605-63.
    • Translations of Zhu’s principal essays and statements on key terms, drawn primarily from Zhuzi quanshu; clear and thoroughly annotated.
  • (1966). Reflections on Things at Hand: The Neo-Confucian Anthology Compiled by Chu Hsi and Lu Tsu-ch’ien, New York: Columbia UP.
    • Zhu’s compendium of important early Neo-Confucian pronouncements; clear and well annotated.
  • (ed.) (1986). Chu Hsi and Neo-Confucianism. Honolulu: Hawaii UP.
    • Detailed studies of key issues in Zhu Xi scholarship; for the specialist.
  • (1987). Chu Hsi: Life and Thought. Hong Kong: Hong Kong UP.
    • (General essays; clear and accessible.)
  • (1989). Chu Hsi: New Studies. Honolulu: Hawaii UP.
    • Detailed studies of key issues in Zhu Xi scholarship; for the specialist.
  • Chang, Carsun (1957). “Chu Hsi, The Great Synthesizer,” in The Development of Neo-Confucian Thought, vol. 1, New York: Bookman, 243-332.
    • Aristotelian account of Zhu’s philosophy, viewed in contrast to Zhu’s rivals’ opinions. Attempted corrective of Feng’s platonic reading of Zhu Xi; see next entry.
  • Feng, Youlan (1953). “Chu Hsi,” trans. D. Bodde in A History of Chinese Philosophy, 2 vols., Princeton: Princeton UP, vol. 2, 533-71.
    • Highly influential pioneering platonic account of Zhu’s thought in English; technical but clearly presented.
  • Gardner, Daniel (1986). Chu Hsi and Ta-hsueh: Neo-Confucian Reflection on the Confucian Canon,Cambridge: Harvard UP.
    • Translation of Zhu’s commentary on the “Great Learning,” a major classical cultivation text; with excellent commentary and supporting essays.)
  • (1990). Learning to Be a Sage: Selections from the Conversations of Master Chu, Arranged Topically,Berkeley: California UP.
    • (Zhu’s teachings on learning and study as a method of self-cultivation; very clear and accessible.
  • (2003). Zhu Xi’s Reading of the Analects: Canon, Commentary and the Classical Tradition, New York: Columbia UP.
    • Insightful, corrective study of Zhu’s mission and accomplishment in writing this commentary.
  • Graham, A.C. (1986) “What was New in the Ch’eng-Chu Theory of Human Nature?” in Wing-tsit Chan (ed) Chu Hsi and Neo-Confucianism, Honolulu: Hawaii UP, 138-157.
    • Ground-breaking study; corrective reinterpretation of Zhu’s main concepts and ethical thought.
  • Kim, Yung Sik (2000). The Natural Philosophy of Chu Hsi 1130-1200, Philadelphia: American Philosophical Society.
    • Clear and multifaceted study of Zhu’s proto-scientific efforts and achievements; see Thompson 2002b for critical analysis.
  • Lovejoy, Arthur O. (1936 & 1964) The Great Chain of Being: A Study of the History of an Idea,Cambridge: Harvard UP.
    • An account of hierarchical systems in the West, to which Zhu’s system is a distant cousin; see Thompson 1994 for discussion.
  • Needham, Joseph (1956a). “The Neo-Confucians,” in Science and Civilisation in China, vol. 2,History of Scientific Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 455-95.
    • Highly influential organismic account of Zhu’s thought; lucid and fascinating.
  • Needham, Joseph (1956b). “Chu Hsi, Leibniz, and the Philosophy of Organism,” in the preceding book, 496-505.
    • Highly influential organismic account of Zhu’s thought; lucid and fascinating.
  • Schirokauer, Conrad (1962). “Chu Hsi’s Political Career: A Study in Ambivalence,” in A. Wright and D. Twichert (eds) Confucian Personalities, Stanford: Stanford UP, 162-88.
    • Detailed but engaging account.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (1988) “Li and Yi as Immanent: Chu Hsi’s Thought in Practical Perspective,”Philosophy East and West 38 (1): 30-46.
    • Corrective account of Zhu’s ontology and ethical theory; lucid and informative.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (1991). “How to Rejuvenate Ethics: Suggestions from Chu Hsi,” Philosophy East and West (41): 493-513.
    • Examination of how Zhu Xi’s thought could rejuvenate contemporary western ethics.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (1994). “Hierarchy of Immanence: Chu Hsi’s Pattern of Thought,” Humanitas Taiwanica (Wen-shih-che hsueh-pao, National Taiwan University (42): 1-30.
    • Examines parallels and differences between Zhu’s philosophy and Great Chain philosophies of the western tradition, in order to reveal strengths and special features of Zhu’s system.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (2002a). “Ethical Insights from Chu Hsi,” in M. Barnhart, ed., Varieties of Ethical Reflection, New York and London: Lexington Books.
    • Presentation of Zhu’s method of ethical thinking, with applications to some difficult issues in Western ethics.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (2002b). “Review article of “Yung Sik Kim, The Natural Philosophy of Chu Hsi 1130-1200,” China Review International (9): 165-80.
    • Critical examination of Kim’s study of Zhu’s proto-scientific thought.
  • Thompson, Kirill O. (2007). “The Archery of Wisdom in the Stream of Life: Zhu Xi’s Reflections on the Four Books,Philosophy East and West, vol. 56, no. 3 (July).
    • Study of Confucius and Mencius’ fascinating notion of wisdom in the light of Zhu Xi’s salient reflections.
  • Tillman, Hoyt (1992). Confucian Discourse and Chu Hsi’s Ascendancy, Honolulu: Hawaii UP.
    • Detailed historical study that situates Zhu in the context of the intellectual issues and debates of the day.
  • Wilson, Thomas A. (1995) Genealogy of the Way: the construction and uses of the Confucian tradition in late imperial China, Stanford: Stanford University Publications.
    • New approach that sees politics and ideology in the competing accounts of the Confucian Way.
  • Wittenborn, Allen (1991). Further Reflections at Hand: A Reader, New York: University Press of America.
    • Useful compendium of Zhu’s philosophic pronouncements; clear translation with detailed commentary.
  • Zhu Xi (1130-1200). Zhuzi yulei (Classified Dialogues of Master Zhu), trans. J.P. Bruce, The Philosophy of Human Nature, London: Probstain, 1922.
    • Compendium of Zhu’s moral psychology drawn from Zhuzi quanshu (“Complete” Works of Master Zhu), abstruse. Other translated selections can be found in Chan 1963, 1966; Gardner 1986, 1990, 2003; Wittenborn 1991.

Author Information

Kirill O. Thompson
National Taiwan University

Alfred North Whitehead (1861—1947)

WhiteheadAlfred North Whitehead was a notable mathematician, logician, educator and philosopher. The staggering complexity of Whitehead’s thought, coupled with the extraordinary literary quality of his writing, have conspired to make Whitehead (in an oft-repeated saying) one of the most-quoted but least-read philosophers in the Western canon. While he is widely recognized for his collaborative work with Bertrand Russell on the Principia Mathematica, he also made highly innovative contributions to philosophy, especially in the area of process metaphysics. Whitehead was an Englishman by birth and a mathematician by formal education. He was highly regarded by his students as a teacher and noted as a conscientious and hard-working administrator. The volume of his mathematical publication was never great, and much of his work has been eclipsed by more contemporary developments in the fields in which he specialized. Yet many of his works continue to stand out as examples of expository clarity without ever sacrificing logical rigor, while his theory of “extensive abstraction” is considered to be foundational in contemporary field of formal spatial relations known as “mereotopology.”

Whitehead’s decades-long focus on the logical and algebraic issues of space and geometry which led to his work on extension, became an integral part of an explosion of profoundly original philosophical work He began publishing even as his career as an academic mathematician was reaching a close. The first wave of these philosophical works included his Enquiry into the Principles of Natural Knowledge, The Concept of Nature, and The Principle of Relativity, published between 1919 and 1922. These books address the philosophies of science and nature, and include an important critique of the problem of measurement raised by Albert Einstein’s general theory of relativity. They also present an alternative theory of space and gravity. Whitehead built his system around an event-based ontology that interpreted time as essentially extensive rather than point-like.

Facing mandatory retirement in England, Whitehead accepted a position at Harvard in 1924, where he continued his philosophical output. His Science and the Modern World offers a careful critique of orthodox scientific materialism and presents his first worked-out version of the related fallacies of “misplaced concreteness” and “simple location.” The first fallacy is the error of treating an abstraction as though it were concretely real. The second is the error of assuming that anything that is real must have a simple spatial location. But the pinnacle of Whitehead’s metaphysical work came with his monumental Process and Reality in 1929 and his Adventures of Ideas in 1933. The first of these books gives a comprehensive and multi-layered categoreal system of internal and external relations that analyzes the logic of becoming an extension within the context of a solution to the problem of the one and the many, while also providing a ground for his philosophy of nature. The second is an outline of a philosophy of history and culture within the framework of his metaphysical scheme.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Thought and Writings
    1. Major Thematic Structures
    2. Mathematical Works
    3. Writings on Education
    4. Philosophy of Nature
    5. Metaphysical Works
  3. Influence and Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Alfred North Whitehead was born on February 15th, 1861 at Ramsgate in Kent, England, to Alfred and Maria Whitehead. Thought by his parents to be too delicate for the rough and tumble world of the English public school system, young Alfred was initially tutored at home. Ironically, when he was finally placed in public school, Whitehead became both head boy of his house and captain of his school’s rugby team. Whitehead always looked upon his days as a boy as a rather idyllic time. The education he received at home was always congenial to his natural habit of thinking, and he was able to spend long periods of time walking about in English country settings that were rich with history.

While Whitehead always enjoyed the classics, his true strength was with mathematics. Because of both its quality, and the unique opportunity to take the entrance examinations early, Alfred tested for Trinity College, Cambridge, in 1879, a year before he would otherwise have been allowed to enter. Whitehead’s focus was in mathematics, as were those of about half the hopefuls that were taking the competitive exams that year. While not in the very top tier, Whitehead’s exam scores were nevertheless good enough to gain him entrance into Trinity for the school year beginning in 1880, along with a £50 scholarship. While the money was certainly important, the scholarship itself qualified Whitehead for further rewards and considerations, and set him on the path to eventually being elected a Fellow of Trinity.

This happened in 1884, with the completion of his undergraduate work and his high standing in the finals examinations in mathematics for that year. Whitehead’s early career was focused on teaching, and it is known that he taught at Trinity during every term from 1884 to 1910. He traveled to Germany during an off-season at Cambridge (probably 1885), in part to learn more of the work of such German mathematicians as Felix Klein. Whitehead was also an ongoing member of various intellectual groups at Cambridge during this period. But he published nothing of note, and while he was universally praised as a teacher, the youthful Alfred displayed little promise as a researcher.

In 1891, when he was thirty years of age, Whitehead married Evelyn Wade. Evelyn was in every respect the perfect wife and partner for Alfred. While not conventionally intellectual, Evelyn was still an extremely bright woman, fiercely protective of Alfred and his work, and a true home-maker in the finest sense of the term. Although Evelyn herself was never fully accepted into the social structures of Cambridge society, she always ensured that Alfred lived in a comfortable, tastefully appointed home, and saw to it that he had the space and opportunity to entertain fellow scholars and other Cambrians in a fashion that always reflected well upon the mathematician.

It is also in this period that Whitehead began work on his first major publication, his Treatise on Universal Algebra. Perhaps with his new status as a family man, Whitehead felt the need to better establish himself as a Cambridge scholar. The book would ultimately be of minimal influence in the mathematical community. Indeed, the mathematical discipline that goes by that name shares only its name with Whitehead’s work, and is otherwise a very different area of inquiry. Still, the book established Whitehead’s reputation as a scholar of note, and was the basis for his 1903 election as a Fellow of the Royal Society.

It was after the publication of this work that Whitehead began the lengthy collaboration with his student, and ultimately Trinity Fellow, Bertrand Russell, on that monumental work that would become the Principia Mathematica. However, the final stages of this collaboration would not occur within the precincts of Cambridge. By 1910, Whitehead had been at Trinity College for thirty years, and he felt his creativity was being stifled. But it was also in this year that Whitehead’s friend and colleague Andrew Forsyth’s long-time affair with a married woman turned into a public indiscretion. It was expected that Forsyth would lose his Cambridge professorship, but the school took the extra step of withdrawing his Trinity Fellowship as well. Publicly in protest of this extravagant action, Whitehead resigned his own professorship (though not his Fellowship) as well. Privately, it was the excuse he needed to shake up his own life.

At the age of 49 and lacking even the promise of a job, Whitehead moved his family to London, where he was unemployed for the academic year of 1910 – 11. It was Evelyn who borrowed or bullied the money from their acquaintances that kept the family afloat during that time. Alfred finally secured a lectureship at University College, but the position offered no chance of growth or advancement for him. Finally in 1914, the Imperial College of Science and Technology in London appointed him as a professor of applied Mathematics.

It was here that Whitehead’s initial burst of philosophical creativity occurred. His decades of research into logic and spatial reasoning expressed itself in a series of three profoundly original books on the subjects of science, nature, and Einstein’s theory of relativity. At the same time, Whitehead maintained his teaching load while also assuming an increasing number of significant administrative duties. He was universally praised for his skill in all three of these general activities. However, by 1921 Whitehead was sixty years old and facing mandatory retirement within the English academic system. He would only be permitted to work until his sixty-fifth birthday, and then only with an annual dispensation from Imperial College. So it was that in 1924, Whitehead accepted an appointment as a professor of philosophy at Harvard University.

While Whitehead’s work at Imperial College is impressive, the explosion of works that came during his Harvard years is absolutely astounding. These publications include Science and the Modern World, Process and Reality, and Adventures of Ideas.

Whitehead continued to teach at Harvard until his retirement in 1937. He had been elected to the British Academy in 1931, and awarded the Order of Merit in 1945. He died peacefully on December 30th, 1947. Per the explicit instructions in his will, Evelyn Whitehead burned all of his unpublished papers. This action has been the source of boundless regret for Whitehead scholars, but it was Whitehead’s belief that evaluations of his thought should be based exclusively on his published work.

2. Thought and Writings

a. Major Thematic Structures

The thematic and historical analyses of Whitehead’s work largely coincide. However, these two approaches naturally lend themselves to slightly different emphases, and there are important historical overlaps of the dominating themes of his thought. So it is worthwhile to view these themes ahistorically prior to showing their temporal development.

The first of these thematic structures might reasonably be called “the problem of space.” The confluence of several trends in mathematical research set this problem at the very forefront of Whitehead’s own inquiries. James Clerk Maxwell’s Treatise on electromagnetism had been published in 1873, and Maxwell himself taught at Cambridge from 1871 until his death in 1879. The topic was a major subject of interest at Cambridge, and Whitehead wrote his Trinity Fellowship dissertation on Maxwell’s theory. During the same period, William Clifford in England, and Felix Klein and Wilhelm Killing in Germany were advancing the study of spaces of constant curvature. Whitehead was well aware of their work, as well as that of Hermann Grassmann, whose ideas would later become of central importance in tensor analysis.

The second major trend of Whitehead’s thought can be usefully abbreviated as “the problem of history,” although a more accurate descriptive phrase would be “the problem of the accretion of value.” Of the two themes, this one can be the more difficult to discern within Whitehead’s corpus, partly because it is often implicit and does not lend itself to formalized analysis. In its more obvious forms, this theme first appears in Whitehead’s writings on education. However, even in his earliest works, Whitehead’s concern with the function of symbolism as an instrument in the growth of knowledge shows a concern for the accretion of value. Nevertheless, it is primarily with his later philosophical work that this topic emerges as a central element and primary focus of his thought.

b. The Early Mathematical Works

Whitehead’s first major publication was his A Treatise on Universal Algebra with Applications (“UA,” 1898.) (Whenever appropriate, common abbreviations will be given, along with the year of publication, for Whitehead’s major works.) Originally intended as a two-volume work, the second volume never appeared as Whitehead’s thinking on the subject continued to evolve, and as the plans for Principia Mathematica eventually came to incorporate many of the objectives of this volume. Despite the “algebra” in the title, the work is primarily on the foundations of geometry and formal spatial relations. UA offers little in the way of original research by Whitehead. Rather, the work is primarily expository in character, drawing together a number of previously divergent and scattered themes of mathematical investigation into the nature of spatial relations and their underlying logic, and presenting them in a systematic form.

While the book helped establish Whitehead’s reputation as a scholar and was the basis of his election as a Fellow of the Royal Society, UA had little direct impact on mathematical research either then or later. Part of the problem was the timing and approach of Whitehead’s method. For while he was very explicit about the need for the rigorous development of symbolic logic, Whitehead’s logic was “algebraic” in character. That is to say, Whitehead's focus was on relational systems of order and structure preserving transformations. In contrast, the approaches of Giuseppe Peano and Gottlob Frege, with their emphasis on proof and semantic relations, soon became the focus of mathematical attention. While these techniques were soon to become of central importance for Whitehead’s own work, the centrality of algebraic methods to Whitehead’s thinking is always in evidence, especially in his philosophy of nature and metaphysics. The emphasis on structural relations in these works is a key component to understanding his arguments.

In addition, UA itself was one in a rising chorus of voices that had begun to take the work of Hermann Grassmann seriously. Grassmann algebras would come to play a vital role in tensor analysis and general relativity. Finally, the opening discussion of UA regarding the importance and uses of formal symbolism remains of philosophical interest, both in its own right and as an important element in Whitehead’s later thought.

Other early works by Whitehead include his two short books, the Axioms of Projective Geometry (1906) and the Axioms of Descriptive Geometry (1907). These works take a much more explicitly logical approach to their subject matter, as opposed to the algebraic techniques of Whitehead’s first book. However, it remains the case that these two works are not about presenting cutting edge research so much as they are about the clear and systematic development of existing materials. As suggested by their titles, the approach is axiomatic, with the axioms chosen for their illustrative and intuitive value, rather than their strictly logical parsimony. As such, these books continue to serve as clear and concise introductions to their subject matters.

Even as he was writing the two Axioms books, Whitehead was well into the collaboration with Bertrand Russell that would lead to the three volumes of the Principia Mathematica. Although most of the Principia was written by Russell, the work itself was a truly collaborative endeavor, as is demonstrated by the extant correspondence between the two. The intention of the Principia was to deduce the whole of arithmetic from absolutely fundamental logical principles. But Whitehead’s role in the project, besides working with Russell on the vast array of details in the first three volumes, was to be the principal author of a fourth volume whose focus would be the logical foundations of geometry. Thus, what Whitehead had originally intended to be the second volume of UA had transformed into the fourth volume of the Principia Mathematica, and like that earlier planned volume, the fourth part of Principia Mathematica never appeared. It would not be until Whitehead’s published work on the theory of extension, work that never appeared independently but always as a part of a larger philosophical enterprise, that his research into the foundations of geometry would finally pay off.

c. Writings on Education

By the time the Principia was published, Whitehead had left his teaching position at Trinity, and eventually secured a lectureship at London’s University College. It was in these London years that Whitehead published a number of essays and addresses on the theory of education. But it would be a mistake to suppose that his concern with education began with the more teaching-oriented (as opposed to research-oriented) positions he occupied after departing Cambridge. Whitehead had long been noted as an exceptional lecturer by his students at Cambridge. He also took on less popular teaching duties, such as teaching at the non-degree conferring women’s institutions associated with Cambridge of Girton and Newham colleges.

Moreover, the concern for the conveyance of ideas is evident from the earliest of Whitehead’s writings. The very opening pages of UA are devoted to a discussion of the reasons and economies of well-chosen symbols as aids to the advancement of thought. Or again, the intention underlying the two Axioms books was not so much the advancement of research as the communication of achieved developments in mathematics. Whitehead’s book, An Introduction to Mathematics (1911), published in the midst of the effort to get the Principia out, had no research agenda per se. This book was again entirely devoted toward introducing students to the character of mathematical thought, to the methods of abstraction, the nature of variables and functions, and to offer some sense of the power and generality of these formalisms.

Whitehead’s essays that specifically address education often do so with the explicit desire to revise the teaching of mathematics in England. But they also argue, both explicitly and implicitly, for a balance of liberal education devoted to the opening of the mind, with technical education intended to facilitate the vocational aptitudes of the student. Education for Whitehead was never just the mere memorization of ancient stories and empty abstractions, any more than it was just the technical training of the working class. It always entailed the growth of the student as a fully functioning human being. In this respect, as well as others, Whitehead’s arguments compare favorably with those of John Dewey [[hyperlink]].

Whitehead never systematized his educational thought the way Dewey did, so these ideas must be gleaned from his various essays and looked for as an implicit foundation to such larger works as his Adventures of Ideas (see below). Many of Whitehead’s essays on education were collected together in The Aims of Education, published in 1929, as well as his Essays in Science and Philosophy, published in 1948.

d. The Philosophy of Nature

Whitehead’s interest in the problem of space was, at least from his days as a graduate student at Cambridge, more than just an interest in the purely formal or mathematical aspects of geometry. It is to be recalled that his dissertation was on Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism, which was a major development in the ideas that led to Einstein’s theories of special and general relativity. The famous Michelson-Morely experiment to measure the so-called “Ether drift” was a response to Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism. Einstein himself offers only a generic nod toward the experiments regarding space and light in his 1905 paper on special relativity. The problem Einstein specifically cites in that paper is the lack of symmetry then to be found in theories of space and the behavior of electromagnetic phenomena. By 1910, when the first volume of the Principia Mathematica was being published, Hermann Minkowski had reorganized the mathematics of Einstein’s special relativity into a four-dimensional non-Euclidean manifold. By 1914, two years before the publication of Einstein’s paper on general relativity, theoretical developments had advanced to the extent that an expedition to the Crimea was planned to observe the predicted bending of stellar light around the sun during an eclipse. This expedition was cancelled with the eruption of the First World War.

These developments helped conspire to prevent Whitehead’s planned fourth volume of the Principia from ever appearing. A few papers appeared during the war years, in which a relational theory of space begins to emerge. What is perhaps most notable about these papers is that they are no longer specifically mathematical in nature, but are explicitly philosophical. Finally, in 1919 and 1920, Whitehead’s thought appeared in print with the publications of two books, An Enquiry into the Principles of Natural Knowledge (“PNK,” 1919) and The Concept of Nature (“CN,” 1920).

While PNK is much more formally technical than CN, both books share a common and radical view of nature and science that rejects the identification of nature with the mathematical tools used to characterize its relational structures. Nature for Whitehead is that which is experienced through the senses. For this reason, Whitehead argues that there are no such things as “points” of either time or space. An infinitesimal point is a high abstraction with no experiential reality, while time and space are irreducibly extensional in character.

To account for the effectiveness of mathematical abstractions in their application to natural knowledge, Whitehead introduced his theory of “extensive abstraction.” By using the logical and topological structures of concentric part-whole relations, Whitehead argued that abstract entities such as geometric points could be derived from the concrete, extensive relations of space and time. These abstract entities, in their turn, could be shown to be significant of the nature they had been abstractively derived from. Moreover, since these abstract entities were formally easier to use, their significance of nature could be retained through their various deductive relations, thereby giving evidence for further natural significances by this detour through purely abstract relations.

Whitehead also rejected “objects” as abstractions, and argued that the fundamental realities of both experience and nature are events. Events are themselves irreducibly extended entities, where the temporal / durational extension is primary. “Objects” are the idealized significances that retain a stable meaning through an event or family of events.

It is important to note here that Whitehead is arguing for a kind of empiricism. But, as Victor Lowe has noted, this empiricism is more akin to the ideas of William James than it is to the logical positivism of Whitehead’s day. In other words, Whitehead is arguing for a kind of Jamesian “radical empiricism,” in which sense-data are abstractions, and the basic deliverances of raw experience include such things as relations and complex events.

These ideas were further developed with the publication of Whitehead’s The Principles of Relativity with Applications to Natural Science (“R,” 1922). Here Whitehead proposed an alternative physical theory of space and gravity to Einstein’s general relativity. Whitehead’s theory has commonly been classified as “quasi-linear” in the physics literature, when it should properly be describes as “bimetric.” Einstein’s theory collapses the physical and the spatial into a single metric, so that gravity and space are essentially identified. Whitehead pointed out that this then loses the logical relations necessary to make meaningful cosmological measurements. In order to make meaningful measurements of space, we must know the geometry of that space so that the congruence relations of our measurement instruments can be projected through that space while retaining their significance. Since Einstein’s theory loses the distinction between the physical and the geometrical, the only way we can know the geometry of the space we are trying to measure is if we first know the distributions of matter and energy throughout the cosmos that affect that geometry. But we can only know these distributions if we can first make accurate measurements of space. Thus, as Whitehead argued, we are left in the position of first having to know everything before we can know anything.

Whitehead argued that the solution to this problem was to separate the necessary relations of geometry from the contingent relations of physics, so that one’s theory of space and gravity is “bimetric,” or is built from the two metrics of geometry and physics. Unfortunately, Whitehead never used the term “bimetric,” and his theory has often been misinterpreted. Questions of the viability of Whitehead’s specific theory have needlessly distracted both philosophers and physicists from the real issue of the class of theories of space and gravity that Whitehead was arguing for. Numerous viable bimetric alternatives to Einstein’s theory of relativity are currently known in the physics literature. But because Whitehead’s theory has been misclassified and its central arguments poorly understood, the connections between Whitehead’s philosophical arguments and these physical theories have largely gone unnoticed.

e. The Metaphysical Works

The problems Whitehead had engaged with his triad of works on the philosophy of nature and science required a complete re-evaluation of the assumptions of modern science. To this end, Whitehead published Science in the Modern World (“SMW,” 1925). This work had both a critical and a constructive aspect, although the critical themes occupied most of Whitehead’s attention. Central to those critical themes was Whitehead’s challenge to dogmatic scientific materialism developed through an analysis of the historical developments and contingencies of that belief. In addition, he continued with the themes of his earlier triad, arguing that objects in general, and matter in particular, are abstractions. What are most real are events and their mutual involvements in relational structures.

Already in PNK, Whitehead had characterized electromagnetic phenomena by saying that while such phenomena could be related to specific vector quantities at each specific point of space, they express “at all points one definite physical fact” (PNK, 29). Physical facts such as electromagnetic phenomena are single, relational wholes, but they are spread out across the cosmos. In SMW Whitehead called the failure to appreciate this holism and the relational connectedness of reality, “the fallacy of simple location.” According to Whitehead, much of contemporary science, driven as it was by the dogma of materialism, was committed to the fallacy that only such things as could be localized at a mathematically simple “point” of space and time were genuinely real. Relations and connections were, in this dogmatic view, secondary to and parasitic upon such simply located entities. Whitehead saw this as reversing the facts of nature and experience, and devoted considerable space in SMW to criticizing it.

A second and related fallacy of contemporary science was what Whitehead identified in SMW as, “the fallacy of misplaced concreteness.” While misplaced concreteness could include treating entities with a simple location as more real than those of a field of relations, it also went beyond this. Misplaced concreteness included treating “points” of space or time as more real than the extensional relations that are the genuine deliverances of experience. Thus, this fallacy resulted in treating abstractions as though they were concretely real. In Whitehead’s view, all of contemporary physics was infected by this fallacy, and the resultant philosophy of nature had reversed the roles of the concrete and the abstract.

The critical aspects of SMW were ideas that Whitehead had already expressed (in different forms) in his previous publications, only now with more refined clarity and persuasiveness. On the other hand, the constructive arguments in SMW are astonishing in their scope and subtlety, and are the first presentation of his mature metaphysical thinking. For example, the word “prehension,” which Whitehead defines as “uncognitive apprehension” (SMW 69) makes its first systematic appearance in Whitehead’s writings as he refines and develops the kinds and layers of relational connections between people and the surrounding world. As the “uncognitive” in the above is intended to show, these relations are not always or exclusively knowledge based, yet they are a form of “grasping” of aspects of the world. Our connection to the world begins with a “pre-epistemic” prehension of it, from which the process of abstraction is able to distill valid knowledge of the world. But that knowledge is abstract and only significant of the world; it does not stand in any simple one-to-one relation with the world. In particular, this pre-epistemic grasp of the world is the source of our quasi- a priori knowledge of space which enables us to know of those uniformities that make cosmological measurements, and the general conduct of science, possible.

SMW goes far beyond the purely epistemic program of Whitehead’s philosophy of nature. The final three chapters, entitled “God,” “Religion and Science,” and “Requisites for Social Progress,” clearly announce the explicit emergence of the second major thematic strand of Whitehead’s thought, the “problem of history” or “the accretion of value.” Moreover, these topics are engaged with the same thoroughly relational approach that Whitehead previously used with nature and science.

Despite the foreshadowing of these last chapters of SMW, Whitehead’s next book may well have come as a surprise to his academic colleagues. Whitehead’s brief Religion in the Making (“RM,” 1926) tackles no part of his earlier thematic problem of space, but instead focuses entirely on the second thematic of history and value. Whitehead defines religion as “what the individual does with his own solitariness” (RM 16). Yet it is still Whitehead the algebraist who is constructing this definition. Solitariness is understood as a multi-layered relational modality of the individual in and toward the world. In addition, this relational mode cannot be understood in separation from its history. On this point, Whitehead compares religion with arithmetic. Thus, an understanding of the latter makes no essential reference to its history, whereas for religion such a reference is vital. Moreover, as Whitehead states, “You use arithmetic, but you are religious” (RM 15).

Whitehead also argues that, “The purpose of God is the attainment of value in the temporal world,” and “Value is inherent in actuality itself” (RM 100). Whitehead’s use of the word “God” in the foregoing invites a wide range of habitual assumptions about his meaning, most, if not all, of which will probably be mistaken. The key element for Whitehead is value. God, like arithmetic, is discussed in terms of something which has a purpose. On the other hand, value is like being religious in that it is inherent. It is something that is rather than something that is used.

Shortly after this work, there appeared another book whose brevity betrays its importance, Symbolism its Meaning and Effect (“S,” 1927). Whitehead’s explicit interest in symbols was present in his earliest publication. But in conjunction with his theory of prehension, the theory of symbols came to take on an even greater importance for him. Our “uncognitive” sense-perceptions are directly caught up in our symbolic awareness as is shown by the immediacy with which we move beyond what is directly given to our senses. Whitehead uses the example of a puppy dog that sees a chair as a chair rather than as a patch of color, even though the latter is all that impinges on the dog’s retina. (Whitehead may not have known that dogs are color blind, but this does not significantly affect his example.) Thus, this work further develops Whitehead’s theories of perception and awareness, and does so in a manner that is relatively non-technical. Because of the centrality of the theory of symbols and perception to Whitehead’s later philosophy, this clarity of exposition makes this book a vital stepping stone to what followed.

What followed was Process and Reality (“PR,” 1929). This book is easily one of the most dense and difficult works in the entire Western canon. The book is rife with technical terms of Whitehead’s own invention, necessitated by his struggle to push beyond the inherited limits of the available concepts toward a comprehensive vision of the logical structures of becoming. It is here that we see the problem of space receive its ultimate payoff in Whitehead’s thought. But this payoff comes in the form of a fully relational metaphysical scheme that draws upon his theory of symbols and perception in the most essential manner possible. At the same time, PR plants the seeds for the further engagement of the problem of the accretion of value that is to come in his later work. Because each process of becoming must be considered holistically as an essentially organic unity, Whitehead often refers to his theory as the “philosophy of organism.”

PR invites controversy while defying brief exposition. Many of the relational ideas Whitehead develops are holistic in character, and thus do not lend themselves to the linear presentation of language. Moreover, the language Whitehead needs to build his holistic image of the world is often biological or mentalistic in character, which can be jarring when the topic being discussed is something like an electron. Moreover, Whitehead the algebraist was an intrinsically relational thinker, and explicitly characterized the subject / predicate mode of language as a “high abstraction.” Nevertheless, there are some basic ideas which can be quickly set out.

The first of these is that PR is not about time per se. This has been a subject of much confusion. But Whitehead himself points out that physical time as such only comes about with “reflection” of the “divisibility” of his two major relational types into one another (PR 288 – 9). Moreover, throughout PR, Whitehead continues to endorse the theory of nature found in his earlier triad of books on the subject. So the first step in gaining a handle on PR is to recognize that it is better thought of as addressing the logic of becoming, whereas his books from 1919 – 1922 address the “nature” of time.

The basic units of becoming for Whitehead are “actual occasions.” Actual occasions are “drops of experience,” and relate to the world into which they are emerging by “feeling” that relatedness and translating it into the occasion’s concrete reality. When first encountered, this mode of expression is likely to seem peculiar if not downright outrageous. One thing to note here is that Whitehead is not talking about any sort of high-level cognition. When he speaks of “feeling” he means an immediacy of concrete relatedness that is vastly different from any sort of “knowing,” yet which exists on a relational spectrum where cognitive modes can emerge from sufficiently complex collections of occasions that interrelate within a systematic whole. Also, feeling is a far more basic form of relatedness than can be represented by formal algebraic or geometrical schemata. These latter are intrinsically abstract, and to take them as basic would be to commit the fallacy of misplaced concreteness. But feeling is not abstract. Rather, it is the first and most concrete manifestation of an occasion’s relational engagement with reality.

This focus on concrete modes of relatedness is essential because an actual occasion is itself a coming into being of the concrete. The nature of this “concrescence,” using Whitehead’s term, is a matter of the occasion’s creatively internalizing its relatedness to the rest of the world by feeling that world, and in turn uniquely expressing its concreteness through its extensive connectedness with that world. Thus an electron in a field of forces “feels” the electrical charges acting upon it, and translates this “experience” into its own electronic modes of concreteness. Only later do we schematize these relations with the abstract algebraic and geometrical forms of physical science. For the electron, the interaction is irreducibly concrete.

Actual occasions are fundamentally atomic in character, which leads to the next interpretive difficulty. In his previous works, events were essentially extended and continuous. And when Whitehead speaks of an “event” in PR without any other qualifying adjectives, he still means the extensive variety found in his earlier works (PR 73). But PR deals with a different set of problems from that previous triad, and it cannot take such continuity for granted. For one thing, Whitehead treats Zeno's Paradoxes very seriously and argues that one cannot resolve these paradoxes if one starts from the assumption of continuity, because it is then impossible to make sense of anything coming immediately before or immediately after anything else. Between any two points of a continuum such as the real number line there are an infinite number of other points, thus rendering the concept of the “next” point meaningless. But it is precisely this concept of the “next occasion” that Whitehead requires to render intelligible the relational structures of his metaphysics. If there are infinitely many occasions between any two occasions, even ones that are nominally “close” together, then it becomes impossible to say how it is that later occasions feel their predecessors – there is an unbounded infinity of other occasions intervening in such influences, and changing it in what are now undeterminable ways. Therefore, Whitehead argued, continuity is not something which is “given;” rather it is something which is achieved. Each occasion makes itself continuous with its past in the manner in which it feels that past and creatively incorporates the past into its own concrescence, its coming into being.

Thus, Whitehead argues against the “continuity of becoming” and in favor of the “becoming of continuity” (PR 68 – 9). Occasions become atomically, but once they have become they incorporate themselves into the continuity of the universe by feeling the concreteness of what has come before and making that concreteness a part of the occasion’s own internal makeup. The continuity of space and durations in Whitehead’s earlier triad does not conflict with his metaphysical atomism, because those earlier works were dealing with physical nature in which continuity has already come into being, while PR is dealing with relational structures that are logically and metaphysically prior to nature.

Most authors believe that the sense of “atomic” being used here is similar to, if not synonymous with, “microscopic.” However, there are reasons why one might want to resist such an interpretation. To begin with, it teeters on the edge of the fallacy of simple location to assume that by “atomic” Whitehead means “very small.” An electron, which Whitehead often refers to as an “electronic occasion,” may have a tiny region of most highly focused effects. But the electromagnetic field that spreads out from that electron reaches far beyond that narrow focus. The electron “feels” and is “felt” throughout this field of influence which is not spatially limited. Moreover, Whitehead clearly states that space and time are derivative notions from extension whereas, “To be an actual occasion in the physical world means that the entity in question is a relatum in this scheme of extensive connection” (PR 288 – 9). The quality of being microscopic is something that only emerges after one has a fully developed notion of space, while actual occasions are logically prior to space and a part of the extensive relations from which space itself is derived. Thus it is at least arguably the case that the sense of “atomic” that Whitehead is employing hearkens back more to the original Greek meaning of “irreducible” than to the microscopic sense that pervades physical science. In other words, the “atomic” nature of what is actual is directly connected to its relational holism.

The structure of PR is also worth attention, for each of the five major parts offers a significant perspective on the whole. Part I gives Whitehead’s defense of speculative philosophy and sets out the “categoreal scheme” underlying PR. The second part applies these categories to a variety of historical and thematic topics. Part three gives the theory of prehensions as these manifest themselves with and through the categories, and is often called the “genetic account.” The theory of extension, or the “coordinate account,” constitutes part four and represents the ultimate development of Whitehead’s rigorous thought on the nature of space. The last and final part presents both a theory of the dialectic of opposites, and the minimalist role of God in Whitehead’s system as the foundation of coherence in the world’s processes of becoming.

Two of the features of part I that stand out are Whitehead’s defense of speculative philosophy, and his proposed resolution of the traditional problem of the One and the Many. “Speculative philosophy” for Whitehead is a phrase he uses interchangeably with “metaphysics.” However, what Whitehead means is a speculative program in the most scientifically honorific sense of the term. Rejecting any form of dogmatism, Whitehead states that his purpose is to, “frame a coherent, logical, necessary system of general ideas in terms of which every element of our experience can be interpreted” (PR 3). The second feature, the solution to the problem of the “one and the many,” is often summarized as, “The many become one, and increase by one.” This means that the many occasions of the universe that have already become contribute their atomic reality to the becoming of a new occasion (“the many become one”). However, this occasion, upon fully realizing in its own atomic character, now contributes that reality to the previously achieved realities of the other occasions (“and increase by one”).

The atomic becoming of an actual occasion is achieved by that occasion’s “prehensive” relations and its “extensive” relations. An actual occasion’s holistically felt and non-sequentially internalized concrete evaluations of its relationships to the rest of the world is the subject matter of the theory of “prehension,” part III of PR. This is easily one of the most difficult and complex portions of that work. The development that Whitehead is describing is so holistic and anti-sequential that it might appropriately be compared to James Joyce’s Finnegan’s Wake. An actual occasion “prehends” its world (relationally takes that world in) by feeling the “objective data” of past occasions which the new occasion utilizes in its own concrescence. This data is prehended in an atemporal and nonlinear manner, and is creatively combined into the occasion’s own manifest self-realization. This is to say that the becoming of the occasion is also informed by a densely teleological sense of the occasion’s own ultimate actuality, its “subjective aim” or what Whitehead calls the occasion’s “superject.” Once it has become fully actualized, the occasion as superject becomes an objective datum for those occasions which follow it, and the process begins again.

This same process of concrescence is described in its extensive characters in part IV, where the mereological (formal relations of part and whole) as well as topological (non-metrical relations of neighborhood and connection) characteristics of extension are developed. Unlike the subtle discussion of prehensions, Whitehead’s theory of extension reads very much like a text book on the logic of spatial relations. Indeed, a great deal of contemporary work in artificial intelligence and spatial reasoning identifies this section of PR as foundational to this field of research, which often goes by the intimidating title of “mereotopology.”

The holistic character of prehension and the analytical nature of extension invite the reader to interpret the former as a theory of “internal relations” and the latter as a theory of “external relations.” Put simply, external relations treat the self-identity of a thing as the first, analytically given fact, while internal relations treat it as the final, synthetically developed result. But Whitehead explicitly associates internal relations with extension, and externality with that of prehension. This seeming paradox can be resolved by noting that, even though prehension is the process of the actual occasion’s “internalizing” the rest of reality as it composes its own self-identity, the achieved result (the superject) is the atomic realization of that occasion in its ultimate externality to the rest of the world. On the other hand, the mereological relations of part and whole from which extension is built, are themselves so intrinsically correlative to one another that each only meaningfully expresses its own relational structures to the extent that it completely internalizes the other.

Whitehead was never one to revisit a problem once he felt he had addressed it adequately. With the publication of PR and the final version of his theory of extension, Whitehead never returned to the ‘problem of space’ except on those limited occasions when his later work required that he mention those earlier developments. Those later works were effectively focused upon the ‘problem of history’ to the exclusion of all else. The primary book on this topic is Adventures of Ideas (“AI,” 1933).

AI is a pithy and engaging book whose opening pages entice the reader with clear and evidently non-technical language. But it is a book that needs to be approached with care. Whitehead assumes, without explanation, knowledge on the part of his readers of the metaphysical scheme of PR, and resorts to the terminology of that book whenever the argument requires it. Indeed, AI is the application of Whitehead’s process metaphysics to the “problem of history.” Whitehead surveys numerous cultural forms from a thoroughly relational perspective, analyzing the ways in which these connections contribute both to the rigidities of culture and the possibilities for novelty in various “adventures” in the accumulation of meanings and values. Many of the forces in this adventure of meaning are blind and senseless, thus presenting the challenge of becoming more deliberate in our processes of building and changing them.

In line with this, two other works bear mentioning: The Function of Reason (“FR,” 1929) and Modes of Thought (“MT,” 1938). FR presents an updated version of Aristotle’s three classes of soul (the vegetative, the animate, and the rational); only in Whitehead’s case, the classifications are, as the title states, functional rather than facultative. Thus, for Whitehead, the function of reason is “promote the art of life,” which is a three-fold function of “(i) to live, (ii) to live well, (iii) to live better” (FR 4, 8). Thus, reason for Whitehead is intrinsically organic in both origin and purpose. But the achievement of a truly reasonable life is a matter that involves more than just the logical organization of propositional knowledge. It is a matter of full and sensitive engagement with the entire lived world. This is the topic of MT, Whitehead’s final major publication. In arguing for a multiplicity of modes of thought, Whitehead offered his final great rebellion against the excessive focus on language that dominated the philosophical thought of his day. In this work, Whitehead also offered his final insight as to the purpose and function of philosophy itself. “The use of philosophy,” Whitehead concluded, “is to maintain an active novelty of fundamental ideas illuminating the social system. It reverses the slow descent of accepted thought towards the inactive commonplace.” In this respect, “philosophy is akin to poetry” (MT 174).

3. Influence and Legacy

Evaluating Whitehead’s influence is a difficult matter. While Whitehead’s influence has never been great, in the opening years of the 21st century it appears to be growing in a broad range of otherwise divergent disciplines. Fulfilling his own vision of the use of philosophy, Whitehead’s ideas are a rich trove of alternative approaches to traditional problems. His thoroughgoing relational and process orientation offers numerous opportunities to reimagine the ways in which the world is connected and how those connections manifest themselves.

The most prominent area of ongoing Whiteheadian influence is within process theology. While Whitehead’s explicit philosophical treatments of God seldom went beyond that of an ideal principle of maximal coherence, many others have developed these ideas further. Writers such as Charles Hartshorne and John Cobb have speculated on, and argued for, a much more robust, ontological conception of God. Nothing in Whitehead’s own writings require such developments, but neither are they in any way precluded. The God of process theology tends to be far more personal and much more of a co-participant in the creative process of the universe than that which one often finds in orthodox religions.

Within philosophy itself, Whitehead’s influence has been smaller and much more diffuse. Yet those influences are likely to crop up in what seem, on the surface at least, to be improbable places. The literature here is too vast to enumerate, but it includes researches from all of the major philosophical schools including pragmatism, analytical, and continental thought. The topics engaged include ontology, phenomenology, personalism, philosophical anthropology, ethics, political theory, economics, etc.

There are also a variety of ways in which Whitehead’s work continues to influence scientific research. This influence is, again, typically found only in the work of widely scattered individuals. However, one area where this is not the case is Whitehead’s theory of extension. Whitehead’s work on the logical basis of geometry is widely cited as foundational in the study of mereotopology, which in turn is of fundamental importance in the study of spatial reasoning, especially in the context of artificial intelligence.

There is also a growing interest in Whitehead’s work within physics, where it is proving to be a valuable source of ideas to help re-conceive the nature of physical relations. This is particularly true of such bizarre phenomena as quantum entanglement, which seems to violate orthodox notions of mechanistic interaction. There is a renewed interest in Whitehead’s arguments regarding relativity, particularly because of their potential tie-in with other bimetric theories of space and gravity. Other areas of interest include biology, where Whitehead’s holistic relationalism again offers alternative models of explanation.

4. References and Further Reading

Those of Whitehead’s primary texts which have been mentioned in the article are listed below in chronological order. More technical works have been “starred” with an asterisk. Original publication dates are given, as well as more recent printings. Of these more recent printings, those done by Dover Publications have been favored because they retain the pagination of the original imprints. On the other hand, the volume of the secondary literature on Whitehead is truly astounding, and a comprehensive list would go far beyond the limits of this article. So while the secondary works listed below can hardly be viewed as definitive, they do offer a useful starting place. The secondary sources are divided into two groups, those that are relatively more accessible and those that are relatively more technical.

a. Primary Sources

  • *A Treatise on Universal Algebra (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1898.)
  • *The Axioms of Projective Geometry (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1906.)
  • *The Axioms of Descriptive Geometry, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1907. Mineaola: Dover Phoenix Editions, 2005.)
    • The two Axioms books are models of expository clarity, yet they are still books on formal mathematics. Hence, they have been reluctantly “starred.”
  • *Principia Mathematica, volumes I – III, with Bertrand Russell (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1910 – 1913.)
  • An Introduction to Mathematics (London: Home University Library of Modern Knowledge, 1911. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1958.)
  • *An Enquiry into the Principles of Natural Knowledge (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1919.)
  • The Concept of Nature (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1920. Mineola: Dover, May 2004.)
  • *The Principle of Relativity with Applications to Physical Science (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1922. Mineola: Dover Phoenix Editions, 2004.)
  • Science and the Modern World (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1925. New York: The Free Press, 1967.)
  • Religion in the Making (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1926. New York: Fordham University Press, 1996.)
    • This later edition is particularly useful because of the detailed glossary of terms at the end of the text.
  • Symbolism, Its Meaning and Effect (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1927. New York: Fordham University Press, 1985.)
  • The Aims of Education (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1929. New York: The Free Press, 1967.)
  • **Process and Reality (New York: The Macmillan Company 1929. New York: The Free Press, 1978.)
    • Easily one of the most difficult books in the entire Western philosophical canon, this volume earns two asterisks.
  • The Function of Reason (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1929. Boston: Beacon Press, 1962.)
  • *Adventures of Ideas (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1933. New York: The Free Press, 1985.)
  • Modes of Thought (New York: The Macmillan Company, 1938. New York: The Free Press, 1968.)
  • Essays in Science and Philosophy (New York: Philosophical Library Inc., 1948.)

b. Secondary Sources

(Relatively more accessible secondary texts:)

  • Eastman, Timothy E. and Keeton, Hank (editors): Physics and Whitehead: Quantum, Process, and Experience (Albany: State University of New York Press, January 2004.)
    • This is an important recent survey of some of the ways in which Whitehead’s thought is being employed in contemporary physics.
  • Kraus, Elizabeth M.: The Metaphysics of Experience (New York: Fordham University Press, April 1979.)
    • This book is a particularly useful companion to PR because of the care with which Kraus has flow-charted the relational structures of Whitehead’s argument.
  • Lowe, Victor: Alfred North Whitehead: The Man and his Work, volumes I and II (Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins Press, 1985 & 1990.)
    • These volumes are the definitive biography of Whitehead.
  • Mesle, C. Robert & Cobb, John B.: Process Theology: A Basic Introduction (Atlanta: Chalice Press, September 1994.)
    • This is a solid and very readable survey of contemporary process theology.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur, editor: The Philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead, “The Library of Living Philosophers,” (LaSalle: Open Court Publishing Company, 1951.)
    • This book is a collection of essays on Whitehead’s work by his contemporaries.

(Relatively more technical secondary texts:)

  • Casati, Roberto and Varzi, Achille C.: Parts and Places: The Structures of Spatial Representation (Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 1999.)
    • This text is a college level introduction to mereotopology, and includes an extensive bibliography on the subject and its history.
  • Ford, Lewis: Emergence of Whitehead's Metaphysics, 1925-1929 (Albany: SUNY Press, 1985.)
    • This book is an examination of the historical development of Whitehead’s metaphysical ideas.
  • Hall, David L.: The Civilization of Experience, A Whitehedian Theory of Culture (New York: Fordham University Press, New 1973.)
    • Hall’s work attempts, among other things, to derive an ethical theory from Whitehead’s metaphysics.
  • Jones, Judith A. Intensity: An Essay in Whiteheadian Ontology (Nashville: Vanderbilt University Press, 1998.)
    • This work is widely considered to be one of the most important pieces of secondary literature on Whitehead.
  • Nobo, Jorge Luis.: Whitehead’s Metaphysics of Extension and Solidarity (Albany: SUNY Press, 1986.)
  • Palter, William: Whitehead's Philosophy of Science (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, June 1960.)
    • This work is widely viewed as the definitive text on Whitehead’s theory of science and nature.

Author Information

Gary L. Herstein
Southern Illinois University at Carbondale
U. S. A.

James Beattie (1735—1803)

beattieJames Beattie was a Scottish philosopher and poet who spent his entire academic career as Professor of Moral Philosophy and Logic at Marischal College in Aberdeen. His best known philosophical work, An Essay on The Nature and Immutability of Truth In Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism (1770), is a rhetorical tour de force which affirmed the sovereignty of common sense while attacking David Hume (1711-1776). A smash bestseller in its day, this Essay on Truth made Beattie very famous and Hume very angry. The work's fame proved fleeting, as did Beattie’s philosophical reputation.

While the Essay on Truth is little read today, it is well worth reading. First, it is an important document in the history of the Scottish common sense school of philosophy inaugurated by Beattie's colleague, Thomas Reid (1710-1796). Second, Beattie's style-- lively, polished, pure, and lucid--still has the power to please and charm. Finally, Beattie is an abler philosopher than his vociferous detractors were willing to allow. Though by no means an original or profound thinker, he can and should be given credit for presenting a systematic and accessible defense of a simple-sounding thesis - that philosophy cannot afford to despise the plain dictates of common sense.

This article (1) outlines Beattie's life and career, (2) reviews the basic argument of the Essay on Truth, (3) summarizes the Essay's neglected critique of Hume's racism, (4) briefly describes Beattie's later Elements of Moral Science, and (5) reflects on Beattie's place in the Scottish common sense school.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Career
  2. The Essay on Truth (1770)
  3. Beattie Contra Hume on Racism
  4. Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793)
  5. Beattie and Scottish Common Sense Philosophy
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Career

James Beattie was born October 25, 1735 in Laurencekirk, Kincardineshire, where his father was a farmer and shopkeeper. In 1749 Beattie began his studies at Marischal College, Aberdeen. In 1753, he was awarded the MA degree. He then spent several years as a schoolteacher and briefly contemplated becoming a minister. During this period he also secured the friendship of several influential personages. One of Beattie's early patrons was James Burnett (1714-1799), better known to posterity as Lord Monboddo (which name Burnett assumed when appointed to the Court of Session in 1767).

In 1760, at the tender age of 25, Beattie was installed as Professor of Moral Philosophy and Logic at Marischal College. Shortly thereafter he was elected to the Aberdeen Philosophical Society, known to waggish locals as “the Wise Club.” Founded in 1758 by Thomas Reid (1710-1796) and John Gregory (1724-1773), the Society continued to hold meetings until 1773, nine years after Reid left for Glasgow to fill the Chair of Moral Philosophy vacated by Adam Smith (1723-1790). Much of Beattie's later work had its origin in compositions read to his fellow Aberdonian “wise men” in the 1760s.

A decade after taking up his Professorship at Aberdeen, Beattie published the philosophical work for which he was (and is still) best known: An Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth In Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism (1770) (hereinafter “Essay on Truth”). The honors piled up thick and fast: a doctorate of laws from Oxford; an audience with King George III; a Crown pension of 200 pounds a year; the approbation of discerning literati such as Edmund Burke and Samuel Johnson; and the opportunity to pose for Sir Joshua Reynolds. (Incidentally, Reynold's portrait of Beattie – “The Triumph of Truth, with the Portrait of a Gentleman”- was hung in Marischal College.) Nor was enthusiasm for Beattie's anti-skeptical treatise confined to the British Isles. The Essay was soon translated into French, German, and Dutch and discussed on the Continent. Beattie's fame spread to the New World as well. In 1784 he was made a member of the American Philosophical Society.

Not all citizens of the Republic of Letters, however, were impressed by the Essay on Truth. The book's target, the amiable and good-humored Hume, was incensed. “Truth!” he fumed, “there is no truth in it; it is a horrible large lie in Octavo.” Yet Hume, who had a policy of not answering critics, never deigned to reply directly to the cavils of “that bigoted silly fellow Beattie.” Immanuel Kant (1724-1804), too, had harsh words for Beattie. In Kant's Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics (1783), the Scottish prophet of common sense is portrayed as a superficial, obtuse dogmatist: “I should think that Hume might fairly have laid as much claim to common sense as Beattie, and in addition to a critical reason (such as the latter did not possess).” (For the record, however, it should be noted that Kant (unlike Hume) had an equally low opinion of Reid.)

Beattie wrote no philosophical work equal to the Essay in appeal or influence, although he continued to publish throughout the 1770s and 1780s. Many of these ostensibly “later” works (several of which actually date from the 1760s) are devoted to issues in aesthetics, rhetoric, and literary theory. They include An Essay on Poetry and Music (1776), On the Utility of Classical Learning (1776), An Essay on Laughter, and Ludicrous Composition (1779), and Dissertations Moral and Critical (1783). In addition, he compiled a lexicon entitled Scotticisms, arranged in Alphabetical Order (1787), in which he urged his educated compatriots to improve their English by “purifying” it of Scots expressions.

Beattie also earned plaudits as a poet, largely on the strength of The Minstrel; or, The Progress of Genius, written in Spenserian stanzas. The first part of The Minstrel appeared anonymously in 1771 (a year which also saw two editions of the Essay printed). The second part, to which the author put his name, followed in 1774. Replete with reflections upon Nature and the character of poetic genius, The Minstrel anticipates some of the central preoccupations of the Romantic movement.

Despite his apparent “aesthetic turn” in the post-Essay period, Beattie remained interested in the broader philosophical, moral, and religious questions that had originally prompted him to compose the Essay on Truth in the 1760s. 1786 saw the publication of Evidences of the Christian Religion Briefly and Plainly Stated, a two volume work of popular apologetics. This was followed by his final book, Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793). A lengthy collection of lectures delivered at Marischal College, the Elements deal with a wide range of topics in the philosophy of mind, epistemology, metaphysics, logic, ethics, political philosophy, economics, and natural theology.

Beattie's later years were filled with affliction. His wife, Mary Beattie (née Dunn), went mad and was eventually committed to an asylum. Both of his children died, the elder son in 1790 and the younger in 1796. Weakened by grief, ill health, and a series of strokes, Beattie died in Aberdeen on August 18, 1803.

2. The Essay on Truth (1770)

The Essay on Truth begins predictably enough, with a definition of – what else?- truth. Truth, Beattie avows, is identified with what “the constitution of our nature determines us to believe”; falsehood is identified with what “the constitution of our nature determines us to disbelieve.” (Part I. i). The distinction between common sense and reason is drawn in terms of the way that distinct classes of truths are apprehended. Common sense is identified as “that faculty by which we perceive self-evident truth,” whereas reason is “that power by which we perceive truth in consequence of a proof.” (I. i). With these definitions securely in place, Beattie advances the Essay's principal thesis -- “common sense is the ultimate judge of truth,” (I. i) and reason must be subordinated to it. All sound reasoning, we are told, depends upon the principles of common sense:

In a word, the dictates of common sense are, in respect to human knowledge in general, what the axioms of geometry are in respect to mathematics: on the supposition that those axioms are false or dubious, all mathematical reasoning falls to the ground; and on the supposition that the dictates of common sense are erroneous and deceitful, all science, truth, and virtue, are vain. (I. ii. 9)

What are these axioms of common sense, these foundational principles on which all sound reasoning rests? It is not necessary to discuss all the principles listed in Beattie's catalogue of common sense. For the purpose of illustration, a representative sample of four “principles of common sense” should suffice: (i) the evidence of perception (or “external sense”) is not fallacious, but fundamentally reliable; (ii) whatever begins to exist, proceeds from some cause; (iii) Nature is uniform; and (iv) human testimony is basically trustworthy. Armed with this arsenal of principles, Beattie can now confidently enter the lists against an assortment of formidable philosophical foes. Beattie wielded principle (i) against skeptics (be they Cartesian or Humean), as well as against Berkeleyan idealists; principle (ii) against atheist critics of cosmological arguments; principle (iii) against Humean skeptics about induction; and principle (iv) against Humean scoffers at miracles.

If Beattie is right about common sense, much (if not all) of modern philosophy is wrong. The basic mistake of the moderns lies in their tendency to make reason, not common-sense, the ultimate judge or arbiter of truth. Reason is a shameless upstart who, ignorant of its proper station, disgraces itself by refusing to submit to authority (in the form of common sense). Such insubordination can only lead to chaos, catastrophe, and confusion:

When Reason invades the rights of Common Sense, and presumes to arraign that authority by which she herself acts, nonsense and confusion must of necessity ensue; science will soon come to have neither head nor tail, beginning nor end; philosophy will grow contemptible; and its adherents, far from being treated, as in former times, upon the footing of conjurers, will be thought by the vulgar, and by every man of sense, to be little better than downright fools. (I. ii. 9)

Philosophers therefore despise common sense at their peril. But how are we to distinguish genuine principles of common sense from the pretenders? Is Beattie suggesting that any cherished conviction or idée fixe that I am unable to prove automatically qualifies as a dictate of common sense? He endeavours to supply us with criteria or marks by which authentic principles of common sense can be identified. (1) We are irresistibly inclined by nature to believe the principles of common sense. Our powerful attachment to them, being spontaneous and quasi-instinctive, cannot be destroyed by philosophical argument - no matter how ingenious. (2) The principles of common sense are universally accepted. Far from being prejudices peculiar to a given time, place, culture, sect, or class, they have been believed by virtually all people in all ages. (3) The principles of common sense cannot be proven because they are epistemologically foundational or basic. They cannot be justified by reference to some more evident proposition(s), because none exist. (4) The principles of common sense are indispensable presuppositions of our conduct and practice. We cannot live or act prudently unless we assume that our senses are reliable, that human testimony can be a source of knowledge, that past will resemble the future, and so on. Anyone who actually doubted or denied such principles would put himself on par with the lunatic or the fool.

Here it may be asked: In what way does Beattie's Essay on Truth improve upon Thomas Reid's earlier Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (1764)? The short answer is that it does not. Beattie freely admits that he is heavily indebted to Reid. However, the Essay differs from the Inquiry in one obvious respect: Beattie's tract is infinitely more hard-hitting and caustic than anything ever penned by Reid. Where Reid writes respectfully of his opponents, Beattie tends to denounce and vilify them. Where Reid wraps up his subtle thoughts in restrained professorial prose, Beattie's simple arguments are presented with the spleen and verve of the born orator. These contrasts reflect a more basic difference between our two defenders of common sense. Unlike Reid, Beattie is first and foremost a moralist and an apologist. He is not interested in defending a subtle or nuanced philosophical thesis. Rather, Beattie is defending a lofty (albeit vaguely defined) cause - to wit, “the cause of truth, virtue, and mankind.” Translated into more prosaic (but precise) terms, Beattie's “cause” is that of deflecting philosophical opposition to a broadly Judeo-Christian understanding of human nature. According to this understanding, human beings are free but finite creatures made in the image of a good God or Creator. Neither brutes nor divinities, we occupy an intermediate place in creation and are better suited for action than for speculation. Inasmuch as our cognitive faculties are God-given, we may trust their deliverances - provided we acknowledge their limitations and exercise them under conditions that define our humble “middle state” (to quote Alexander Pope). Beattie's bold strategy in the Essay was to argue that these familiar ideas about human nature are unassailable because they rest on the solid and irrefragable foundation of “common sense” (rather than philosophic demonstrability). Here was a book apt to reassure the devout but timorous Christian reader, for it confidently announced that Humean scepticism – and the bulk of modern philosophy - was infinitely more suited to be ridiculed than to be feared.

3. Beattie Contra Hume on Racism

Although the Essay on Truth is largely devoted to re-instating the rights of common sense in the spheres of epistemology and metaphysics, it includes a forceful critique of Hume's racism.

Hume's racism? To some, this phrase may have a strange and novel sound. After all, Hume is usually portrayed as a patron saint of the Enlightenment: a genial cosmopolitan, sweetly reasonable, unfailingly courteous and amiable, “as approaching as nearly to the idea of a perfectly wise and virtuous man, as perhaps the nature of human frailty will permit” (in the oft-cited words of his friend, Adam Smith). Yet in Hume's essay “Of National Characters,” we catch a glimpse of a different side of le bon David. For there, in an infamous footnote, Hume writes:

I am apt to suspect the negroes to be naturally inferior to the whites. There scarcely ever was a civilized nation of that complexion, nor any individual, eminent either in action or speculation. No ingenious manufactures amongst them, no arts, no sciences ... [T]here are Negroe slaves dispersed all over Europe, of whom none ever discovered any symptoms of ingenuity.

In the Essay on Truth, Beattie condemns these sentiments: “These assertions are strong; but I know not whether they have anything else to recommend them.” (III. ii). Beattie does not stop there. Beattie does not merely fulminate against Hume's racism with a self-serving show of conspicuous indignation; instead he rolls up his sleeves and adroitly dissects Hume's pro-racist arguments. (1) Beattie disputes Hume's basic assertions about the achievements (or alleged lack thereof) of non-European societies: “[W]e know that these assertions are not true ... The Africans and Americans are known to have many ingenious manufactures and arts among them, which even Europeans would find it no easy matter to imitate.” (III. ii). (2) Moreover, Beattie says, Hume's reasoning is invalid. For even if Hume's claims were correct, his conclusion would not follow. “[O]ne may as well say of an infant, that he can never become a man, as of a nation now barbarous, that it never can be civilized.” (III. Ii). Should anyone doubt this, he need only recall that “[t]hat the inhabitants of Great Britain and France were as savage two thousand years ago, as those of Africa and America are at this day.” (III. ii). (3) Beattie is unimpressed by Hume's argument that “there are Negroe slaves dispersed all over Europe, of whom none ever discovered any symptoms of ingenuity.” Beattie insists that this claim is unwarranted as well as false. But even if it were true, it would not justify belief in Hume's natural inferiority thesis, for “the condition of a slave is not favourable to genius of any kind.” (III. ii). (4) While Beattie does not downgrade European achievements in the arts and sciences, he denies that they can be used to prove that European nations or “races” are superior. He stresses the extent that the achievements on which European nations pride themselves were either discovered by accident or the inventions of a gifted few, to whom alone all credit must go.

Beattie caps his rebuttal with two observations. First, his critique of Hume's natural inferiority thesis indirectly supports the cause of religion because such racism cannot be reconciled neatly with a true Judeo-Christian understanding of human nature. Second, Beattie stresses that his disagreement with Hume on the subject of racism is not merely theoretical or speculative. On the contrary, the dispute is intensely practical, for the natural inferiority thesis can (and frequently was) invoked to justify slavery - an institution that Beattie, a committed abolitionist, decried as “a barbarous piece of policy.”

4. Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793)

There is considerable overlap between the Essay on Truth and Beattie's later Elements of Moral Science (1790-1793). The creed of common sense is again soberly recited. We are told that consciousness, memory, and testimony must be taken as trustworthy, that we can assume that Nature is uniform, that we are free moral agents, and that whatever begins to exist must proceed from some cause.

Despite these and other doctrinal similarities, the Elements differs from the Essay in at least four respects. First, stylistically the Essay was full of sarcasm, scorn and splendid invective, while the Elements is comparatively tame, subdued, and dry. Second, the Elements is more philosophically constructive than the Essay, as Beattie now appears more interested in building and inhabiting his own modest system than in laying siege to the systems of foes and rivals. Third, the Elements offers a more in-depth exploration of several topics only lightly touched upon in the Essay (for example, perception, natural theology, and immortality). Finally, the Elements offers sustained coverage of several areas, such as political philosophy and economics, that are not meaningfully discussed in the Essay.

5. Beattie and Scottish Common Sense Philosophy

Historians of Scottish philosophy frequently describe Beattie's Essay as a simplified version of the philosophy of common sense expounded by Reid in his Inquiry of 1764. While there is much truth in this judgment, it need not be construed as a reproach. Popularization can be done well or badly. Beattie did it well.

Nevertheless, it is undeniable that Reid's views on matters philosophical evolved in a way that Beattie's never did. After retiring from teaching in 1781, Reid published two major works, Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (1785) and Essays on the Active Powers of Man (1788). More sophisticated and constructive than anything Beattie ever produced, these two books, along with Reid's earlier Inquiry, became the founding documents of the Scottish common sense school of philosophy. The Reidian gospel was soon propagated with aplomb by Edinburgh Chair-holder Dugald Stewart (1753-1828), who had listened to Reid's lectures in Glasgow. An elegant stylist, Stewart championed common sense both in his well-attended lectures and in his edifying books, the first pair of which - Elements of the Philosophy of the Human Mind (1792) and Outlines of Moral Philosophy (1793) - appeared around the same time as Beattie's Elements of Moral Science. Stewart's interest in Reid was shared by another renowned Edinburgh professor, the erudite but preternaturally verbose Sir William Hamilton (1788-1856). No slavish disciple, Hamilton sought to “improve” on Reid's philosophy in various ways, often by drawing on Kantian doctrines. A singular philosophical beast, the resulting hybrid was slain, stuffed, and mounted by John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) in An Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy (1865). Nevertheless, Hamilton's extensively (or, as some might say, obsessively) annotated edition of Reid's Collected Works did much to make them more widely available.

With Reid cast thus as the heroic founder of the emerging Scotch school, Beattie was relegated to the supporting role of ardent and skilful propagandist. This, at any rate, was how Dugald Stewart portrays Beattie in a letter to Sir William Forbes, Beattie's friend and biographer. Stewart declares that the Essay on Truth is effective as “a popular antidote against the illusions of metaphysical scepticism,” but, he is quick to add, Beattie's polemic lacks the subtlety, patience, and precision we find in Reid. Nevertheless, Stewart avers that Beattie's achievement is not negligible:

These critical remarks on the “Essay on Truth” (I must request you to observe) do not in the least affect the essential merits of that very valuable performance; and I have stated them with the greater freedom, because your late excellent friend possessed so many other unquestionable claims to high distinction – as a moralist, as a critic, as a grammarian, as a pure and classical writer, and, above all, as the author of the “Minstrel.” In any one of the different paths to which his ambition has led him, it would not perhaps be difficult to name some of his contemporaries by whom he has been surpassed; but where is the individual to be found, who has aspired with greater success to an equal variety of literary honours?

Stewart's verdict still seems a just one. Beattie was a talented, ambitious, and multi-faceted man of letters, but his gifts and merits as a philosopher were not the greatest. If philosophy is indeed “a series of footnotes to Plato” (Whitehead), then Beattie can be read as a dramatic footnote to Reid and - ironically - to the abhorred Hume.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Cloyd, E. L. (1972) James Burnett, Lord Monboddo. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Touches on Monboddo's relationship with Beattie; indicates why their friendship did not last.
  • Fieser, J. (1994) “Beattie’s Lost Letter to the London Review,” Hume Studies 20: 1-12.
    • Reconstructs a controversy between Beattie and a pro-Humean literary faction.
  • Fieser, J. (2000) “Introduction” to James Beattie's Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth in Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism. Volume 2 of the 5 volume set, Scottish Common Sense Philosophy: Sources and Origins. (ed. J. Fieser) Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press.
    • Thorough presentation of Beattie's defence of common sense in the Essay on Truth.
  • Fieser, J. (ed.) (2000) Early Responses to Reid, Oswald, Beattie, and Stewart: I. Volume 3 of the 5 volume set, Scottish Common Sense Philosophy: Sources and Origins. Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press.
    • Contains early reviews of the Essay (including Edmund Burke's positive notice of the second edition of 1771).
  • Grave, S.A. (1960) The Scottish Philosophy of Common Sense. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Beattie's epistemological and metaphysical views are portrayed as vulgarized versions of Reid's.
  • Harris, J. A. (2002) “James Beattie, The Doctrine of Liberty, and the Science of the Mind,” Reid Studies (5): 16-29.
    • Acknowledges Beattie's shortcomings as a philosopher, but credits him with a commitment to understanding the human mind scientifically. Sheds light on the Essay's critique of necessitarianism.
  • King, E.H. (1971) “A Scottish “Philosophical” Club in the Eighteenth Century,” Dalhousie Review (50): 201-214.
    • Describes the inner workings of the Aberdeen Philosophical Society, and discusses Beattie's participation.
  • King, E.H. (1972) “James Beattie's Essay on Truth (1770): An Enlightenment “Bestseller”,” Dalhousie Review (51): 390-403.
    • An account of the Essay's popularity.
  • Kuehn, M. (1987) Scottish Common Sense in Germany, 1768-1800: A Contribution to the History of the Critical Philosophy. Kingston and Montreal: McGill-Queen's University Press.
    • Discusses the influence of Reid and, to a lesser extent, Beattie and Oswald upon Kant and his German contemporaries. A clear-headed, fair assessment of Beattie's strengths and weaknesses.
  • McCosh, J. (1875) The Scottish Philosophy. London: Macmillan.
    • Chapter XXIX contains a biographical sketch and an outline of the Essay. Depicts Beattie as an eloquent popularizer of the philosophy of common sense.
  • Mossner, E.C. (1980) The Life of David Hume. 2nd edition. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Briefly describes the reaction of Hume and his Edinburgh circle to the Essay's success.
  • Popkin, R.H. (1980) The High Road to Pyrrhonism. San Diego: Austin Hill Press.
    • Contains an article entitled “Hume's Racism” (pp. 251-266), in which Popkin helpfully puts Beattie's critique of Hume's racism in historical context.
  • Priestley, J. (1774) An Examination of Dr. Reid's Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense, Dr. Beattie's Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth, and Dr. Oswald's Appeal to Common Sense in Behalf of Religion. London: J. Johnson.
    • Includes an extended critique of Beattie, composed shortly after the Essay's publication. Priestley complains that the Essay's author is (among other things) an incorrigible dogmatist who relies too heavily on ad hominem arguments. The Appendix includes some correspondence between Beattie and Priestley.

Author Information

Douglas McDermid
Trent University

Guo Xiang (c. 252—312 C.E.)

Guo Xiang (also known as Kuo Hsiang and Zixuan) is the author of the most important commentary on the classic Daoist text Zhuangzi (Chuang-tzu). He is responsible for the current arrangement of thirty-three chapters divided into inner, outer and miscellaneous sections. His commentary represents a substantial philosophical achievement that has been compared to the Zhuangzi itself. Ostensibly the purpose of a commentary should be to elucidate the ideas in the original text. However, Guo's Zhuangzi commentary adds many original ideas. It is possible to delve deeper into their meaning by examining the text on which he is commenting as if it were a commentary on the work of Guo. The fact that Guo chose to present his philosophy this way—within the framework of this Daoist classic—has served as a blueprint for the manner in which Confucians, Daoists and, increasingly from Guo's time, Buddhists have engaged in constructive dialogue, building systems of thought which include the strengths of all three systems.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Central Concepts
    1. Lone/Self-Transformation and the Absence of a Creator
    2. Ziran, Action and Nonaction
    3. Comfort with One’s Role (an qi fen)
    4. The Sage
  3. Guo Xiang’s Influence on Chinese Thought
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Very little is known about the life of Guo Xiang. He lived in a time of great political upheaval and yet his own political career was one of consistent and significant success. He maintained a high position within one of the six rebellious factions that contributed to the rapid demise of the Western Jin Dynasty (265-316 CE). This fact is interesting because unlike such contemporary figures as Ji Kang (223-262 CE) or Ruan Ji (210-263 CE), who both retired from what they saw as a corrupt governmental system, Guo remained to play what he regarded as the proper role of an engaged public dignitary.

Like the other great figure of the xuanxue (mysterious or profound learning) movement, Wang Bi (Wang Pi, 226-249 CE), Guo sought to synthesize the accepted Confucian morality within an ontological system that would encompass the insights expressed in the Zhuangzi and the Daodejing (Tao Te Ching). But while Wang Bi put the greatest emphasis on the unitary nature of reality, particularly in the concept of wu (nothingness), Guo emphasized individuality and interdependence. Guo's position is not as diametrically opposed to Wang's as is often assumed, Guo does not claim there is a dualist or objective reality to the world around us and he does maintain the use of dao as the unitary, nameless and formless basis of reality. This reality is expressed as a process Guo calls "self-transformation" or "lone transformation" (zihua or duha) in which all things are responsible for their own creation and for the set of relationships that exist between themselves and the rest of the world. Our self-transformation was and is at each moment conditioned by all the self-transformations coming before us and we in turn condition all the self-transformations that come after us. By shifting the focus onto those relationships, Guo arrives at a view of the transcendent sage that is radically different and innovative. While the traditional view of a Daoist sage was someone who removed himself from the mundane world, for Guo this notion is false and misleading. The social and political environments in which people relate to each other are no less natural than a forest or mountaintop and to a person who appreciates why she exists in the particular relationship to others in which she does, the proper course of action is not to run away, but to become involved. In other words, we must become engaged with the world around us, but not because of a continuous state of existence that we share with people and things around us, rather, it is because of a continuous act of creation that at its core makes us responsible for the world and its proper maintenance.

Ji Kang and Ruan Ji pursued the ideal of "overcoming orthodox teaching and following nature" (yue mingjiao er ren ziran). "Orthodox teaching" (mingjiao) includes the proper behavior being matched to the proper role, such as for a parent, a child, a ruler or a subject. Different xuanxue figures accepted these ideals to different extents, but nearly all held them in distinction to ziran, naturalness or spontaneity. Guo's concept of ziran contained all governmental and social spheres, so it made no sense to try to set the realms of mingjiao and ziran in opposition to each other. For Guo, the roles required by Confucian propriety are not imposed upon a natural system that would otherwise be in chaos. They are, instead, the natural result of the system of spontaneous self-transformation and chaos is merely what results when one fails to recognize one's proper role. Guo directs much of the Zhuangzi's advice about equalizing apparent contradiction in this direction.

There is some controversy over the true authorship of Guo's commentary to the Zhuangzi. The earliest source, the Jin Shu (Standard History of the Jin Dynasty), accuses Guo of plagiarizing all but two chapters of the commentary from Xiang Xiu (d. 300 CE), writing a generation earlier. Current scholarship, while acknowledging that Guo made use of Xiang Xiu's work and other earlier commentaries, still credits Guo as the principal author. The evidence for this recognition falls into three main areas. Firstly, the most innovative philosophical features in the commentary do not correspond with those in other works by Xiang Xiu. Secondly, in the early twentieth century, a postface to the commentary was discovered which details the work Guo carried out and finally, various linguistic analyses and references in other works suggest that Guo is the principal author.

2. Central Concepts

a. Lone/Self-transformation and the Absence of a Creator

Guo calls the process by which all things come into existence "lone transformation" (duhua) or "self-transformation" (zihua). The claim that all things share equally in creating the world does not deny that differences exist, but it does deny that these differences translate into differences of value. That one person may be less talented or intelligent than another does not affect the worth of that person, but rather helps determine the proper role for him to play

Given the importance of self-transformation in Guo's philosophical system, he wished to deny any organizing principle. Even Wang Bi's emphasis on wu (nothingness) came too close to occupying the place of an original cause. It was necessary for Guo to draw the line clearly, even if it meant contradicting the text on which he was commenting. In a note to a section of the Zhuangzi that leaves open the question of whether there is a creator, Guo writes:

The myriad things have myriad attributes, the adopting and discarding [of their attributes] is different, as if there was a true ruler making them do so. But if we search for evidence or a trace of this ruler, in the end we will not find it. We will then understand that things arise of themselves, and are not caused by something else. (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 2)

b. Ziran, Action and Nonaction

The natural, spontaneous state of affairs that results from the process of self-transformation is ziran. Ziran is a compound of two different terms zi, meaning "self" and ran, meaning "to be so," and can be translated as "nature," "the self-so," or "things as they are." While many other Daoist thinkers distinguish ziran from the mundane social world in which we live, for Guo they are identical. Even social hierarchy is the natural result of how things come to be as themselves. When we follow our natures, the result is peace and prosperity. When we oppose them, the result is chaos.

Thus, Guo seeks to provide a specific interpretation to the doctrine of nonaction (wuwei). He writes that "taking no action does not mean folding one's arms and closing one's mouth" (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 11). In chapter 3 of the Zhuangzi, we encounter the story of Cook Ding, who carves an ox, not by using his senses or dexterity, but by equating his idea of who he is with his situation and the task at hand. For Guo, if one has correctly perceived the way in which all things share in the creation of ziran, then correct action in the world will follow naturally.

Therefore, what Guo means by ziran is very different from what Western philosophers refer to as "the state of nature." Ziran is the expression of a naturally peaceful and harmonious system, available to all who can recognize their place.

c. Comfort with One's Role (an qi fen)

One key to the correct appreciation of one's place in the world is Guo's concept of fen, meaning "share" or "role." Guo employs the idea of qi (ch'i), "vital energy" or "vital essence," to explain the manner in which the dao imbues the world with life-giving force. One's natural allotment of qi therefore determines one's fen. The proper functioning of the world and the personal happiness of the people in it is maintained by the correct appreciation of one's place. This is not to say Guo denies the possibility of growth and change, which are clear and necessary parts of nature, including social systems. In the same way that the body has hands, feet and head that play different roles according to their different endowments, so the world functions best when people act according to their proper fen. Thus, one's fen is both the allotment of qi received from heaven and the role one must maintain within the system. Indeed, there is no difference between natural abilities and social obligations.

d. The Sage

For Guo, the Sage (shengren) is someone who directs his talent and understanding for the benefit of society. The phrase neisheng waiwang describes someone who is internally like a sage and outwardly acts as a ruler. In Guo's view, the former necessitates the latter. In chapter one of the Zhuangzi, we read the story of the sage ruler Yao, who attempts to cede his throne to the recluse Xu You, but is rebuffed. In the story, it is clear that Xu You has a greater level of understanding than does Yao, but Guo's commentary presents the matter differently:

Are we to insist that a man fold his arms and sit in silence in the middle of some mountain forest before we say that he is practicing nonaction? This is why the words of Laozi and Zhuangzi are rejected by responsible officials. This is why responsible officials insist on remaining in the realm of action without regret … egotistical people set themselves in opposition to things, while he who is in accord with things is not opposed to them … therefore he profoundly and deeply responds to things without any deliberate mind of his own and follows whatever comes into contact with him … he who is always with the people no matter what he does is the ruler of the world wherever he may be. (Zhuangzi commentary, chapter 1)

It seems clear from these sentiments that in Guo's view not only is Yao a better model for a ruler than Xu You, but also that Confucius is a better model for a sage than Zhuangzi.

3. Guo Xiang's Influence on Chinese Thought

The Zhuangzi has long been held in high regard as one of the main pillars of Daoist philosophy, as well as one of the most accessible, entertaining and popular philosophical works of any genre. However the important contribution of Guo to the way in which we understand the Zhuangzi is less well known, particularly in its non-Chinese translations. He deserves credit not only for the external editing and arrangement of the text, but more importantly for developing a philosophical framework that allows for the continued dominance of accepted Confucian codes of proper behavior, yet still keeps open philosophical discussion of wider insights on the nature of reality. While the earlier work of Wang Bi may have eased the entry of Buddhism into the Chinese mainstream, it is within the framework provided by Guo that the three strands of Buddhism, Daoism and Confucianism have found a strategy for coexistence that has contributed to the success and growth of them all.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Allison, Robert E. Chuang-Tzu for Spiritual Transformation. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.
  • Aoki, Goro. "Kaku Sho Soshichu shisen" [Examining Guo Xiang's Zhuangzi commentary]. Kyoto kyoiku gaku kiyo 55 (1979): 196-202.
  • Chan, Alan K.L. "Guo Xiang." In The Encyclopedia of Chinese Philosophy, ed. Anthonio S. Cua, New York: Routledge, 2003, 280-284.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, ed. A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • A good selection of translated passages in addition to an excellent treatment of Guo Xiang's thought and xuanxue in general.
  • Feng, Yu-lan (Feng Youlan) trans. Chuang Tzu: A New Selected Translation with an Exposition of the Philosophy of Kuo Hsiang, Shanghai: Commercial Press, 1933. (Reprint, New York: Gordon, 1975.)
  • Feng, Yu-lan (Feng Youlan). A History of Chinese Philsosophy, v. 2, trans. Derk Bodde. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1953.
  • Fukunaga, Mitsuji. "Kako Sho no Soshi chu to Ko Shu no Shoshi chu" [Guo Xiang's Zhuangzi commentary and Xiang Xiu's Zhuangzi commentary]. Toho gakuho 36 (1964): 187-215.
    • This was some of the groundbreaking work on the Xiang Xiu controversy. Its findings are summarized in English by Livia Knaul's article in The Journal of Chinese Religions.
  • Fukunaga, Mitsuji. "‘No-Mind' in Chuang-tzu and Ch'an Buddhism." Zinbun 12 (1969): 9-45.
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  • Knaul, Livia. "Lost Chuang-tzu Passages." Journal of Chinese Religions 10 (1982): 53-79.
    • This article contains a translation of the "lost" postface, as well as a detailed treatment of the Xiang Xiu controversy.
  • Knaul, Livia. "The Winged Life: Kuo Hsiang's Mystical Philosophy." Journal of Chinese Studies 2.1 (1985): 17-41.
  • Kohn, Livia. Early Chinese Mysticism: Philosophy and Soteriology in the Taoist Tradition. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1992.
  • Kohn, Livia. "Kuo Hsiang and the Chuang-tzu." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 12 (1985): 429-447.
  • Mair, Victor H., ed. Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1983.
  • Mather, Richard B. "The Controversy Over Conformity and Naturalness During the Six Dynasties." History of Religions 9 (1969-1970): 160-180.
  • Robinet, Isabelle. "Kouo Siang ou le monde comme absolu." T'oung Pao 69 (1983): 73-107.
  • Tang Yijie. Guo Xiang. Taibei: Dongda tushugongsi, 1999.
    • One of the most acclaimed biographers of Guo Xiang. Not currently translated into English.
  • Yü, Ying-shih. "Individualism and the Neo-Taoist Movement in Wei-Chin China." In Individualism and Holism: Studies in Confucian and Taoist Values, ed. Donald Munro (Ann Arbor: Center for Chinese Studies, University of Michigan, 1985), 121-155.
  • Ziporyn, Brook. The Penumbra Unbound: The Neo-Taoist Philosophy of Guo Xiang. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Ziporyn, Brook. "The Self-So and Its Traces in the Thought of Guo Xiang." Philosophy East and West 43 (1993): 511-539.
  • Zhuang Yaolang. Guo Xiang xuanxue. Taibei: Liren shuju, 2002.

Author Information

J. Scot Brackenridge
Long Island University
U. S. A.

William of Ockham (Occam, c. 1280—c. 1349)

William of OckhamWilliam of Ockham, also known as William Ockham and William of Occam, was a fourteenth-century English philosopher. Historically, Ockham has been cast as the outstanding opponent of Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274): Aquinas perfected the great “medieval synthesis” of faith and reason and was canonized by the Catholic Church; Ockham destroyed the synthesis and was condemned by the Catholic Church. Although it is true that Aquinas and Ockham disagreed on most issues, Aquinas had many other critics, and Ockham did not criticize Aquinas any more than he did others. It is fair enough, however, to say that Ockham was a major force of change at the end of the Middle Ages. He was a courageous man with an uncommonly sharp mind. His philosophy was radical in his day and continues to provide insight into current philosophical debates.

The principle of simplicity is the central theme of Ockham’s approach, so much so that this principle has come to be known as “Ockham’s Razor.” Ockham uses the razor to eliminate unnecessary hypotheses. In metaphysics, Ockham champions nominalism, the view that universal essences, such as humanity or whiteness, are nothing more than concepts in the mind. He develops an Aristotelian ontology, admitting only individual substances and qualities. In epistemology, Ockham defends direct realist empiricism, according to which human beings perceive objects through “intuitive cognition,” without the help of any innate ideas. These perceptions give rise to all of our abstract concepts and provide knowledge of the world. In logic, Ockham presents a version of supposition theory to support his commitment to mental language. Supposition theory had various purposes in medieval logic, one of which was to explain how words bear meaning. Theologically, Ockham is a fideist, maintaining that belief in God is a matter of faith rather than knowledge. Against the mainstream, he insists that theology is not a science and rejects all the alleged proofs of the existence of God. Ockham’s ethics is a divine command theory. In the Euthyphro dialogue, Plato (437-347 B.C.E.) poses the following question: Is something good because God wills it or does God will something because it is good? Although most philosophers affirm the latter, divine command theorists affirm the former. Ockham’s divine command theory can be seen as a consequence of his metaphysical libertarianism. In political theory, Ockham advances the notion of rights, separation of church and state, and freedom of speech.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. The Razor
  3. Metaphysics: Nominalism
  4. Epistemology
    1. Direct Realist Empiricism
    2. Intuitive Cognition
  5. Logic
    1. Mentalese
    2. Supposition Theory
    3. The Categories
  6. Theology
    1. Fideism
      1. Theology is Not a Science
      2. The Trinity is a Logical Contradiction
      3. There Is No Evidence of Purpose in the Natural World
    2. Against the Proofs of God’s Existence
      1. The Ontological Proof
      2. The Cosmological Proof
  7. Ethics
    1. Divine Command Theory
    2. Metaphysical Libertarianism
  8. Political Theory
    1. Rights
    2. Separation of Church and State
    3. Freedom of Speech
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Ockham’s Works in Latin
    2. Ockham’s Works in English Translation
    3. Books about Ockham

1. Life and Works

Very little biographical information about Ockham survives. There is a record of his ordination in the year 1306. From this, we infer that he was born between 1280 and 1285, presumably in the small town of Ockham, twenty-five miles southwest of London, England. The medieval church in this town, All Saints, recently installed a stained glass window of Ockham because it is probably the church in which he grew up. Nevertheless, we know nothing of Ockham’s childhood or family. Most likely, he spoke Middle English and wrote exclusively in Latin.

Because Ockham joined the Franciscan order (known as the Order of the Friars Minor or OFM), he would have received his early education at a Franciscan house. From there, he pursued a degree in theology at Oxford University. He never completed it, however, because in 1323 he was summoned to the papal court, which had been moved from Rome to Avignon, to answer to charges of heresy.

Ockham remained in Avignon under a loose form of house arrest for four years while the papacy carried out its investigation. Through this ordeal Ockham became convinced that the papacy was corrupt and finally decided to flee with some other Franciscans on trial there. On May 26, 1328 they escaped in the night on stolen horses to the court of Louis of Bavaria, a would-be emperor, who had his own reasons for opposing the Pope. They were all ex-communicated and hunted down but never captured.

After a brief and unsuccessful campaign in Italy, Louis and his entourage settled in Munich. Ockham spent the rest of his days there as a political activist, writing treatises against the papacy. Ockham died sometime between 1347 and 1349, unreconciled with the Catholic Church. Because he never returned to his academic career, Ockham acquired the nickname “Venerable Inceptor”—an “inceptor” being one who is on the point of earning a degree. Ockham’s other nickname is the “More than Subtle Doctor” because he was thought to have surpassed the Franciscan philosopher John Duns Scotus (1265/6-1308), who was known as the Subtle Doctor.

Methodologically, Ockham fits comfortably within the analytic philosophical tradition. He considers himself a devoted follower of Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.), whom he calls “The Philosopher,” though most Aristotle scholars would find many of his interpretations dubious. Ockham may simply have a unique understanding of Aristotle or he may be using Aristotle as cover for developing views he knew would be threatening to the status quo.

Aside from Aristotle, the French Franciscan philosopher Peter John Olivi (1248 - 1298) was the single most important influence on Ockham. Olivi is an extremely original thinker, pioneering direct realism, nominalism, metaphysical libertarianism, and many of the same political views that Ockham defends later in his career. One notable difference between the two, however, is that, while Ockham loves Aristotle, Olivi hates him. Ockham never acknowledges Olivi because Olivi was condemned as a heretic.

Ockham published several philosophical works before losing official status as an academic. The first was his Commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, a standard requirement for medieval theology students. The philosopher and archbishop Peter Lombard (1100–1160/4) composed a book of opinions (sententia) for and against various controversial claims. By commenting on this book, students would learn the art of argumentation while at the same time developing their own views. As a student, Ockham also wrote several commentaries on the works of Aristotle. In addition, he engaged in public debates, the proceedings of which were published under the titles Disputed Questions and Quodlibetal Questions—“quodlibet” meaning “whatever you like.” Ockham’s opus magnum, however, is his Suma Logicae, in which he lays out the fundamentals of his logic and its accompanying metaphysics. We do not know exactly when it was written, but it is the latest of his academic works. After the Avignon affair, Ockham wrote and circulated several political treatises unofficially, the most important of which is his Dialogue on the Power of the Emperor and the Pope. All of Ockham’s works have been edited into modern editions but not all have been translated.

2. The Razor

Ockham’s Razor is the principle of parsimony or simplicity according to which the simpler theory is more likely to be true. Ockham did not invent this principle; it is found in Aristotle, Aquinas, and other philosophers Ockham read. Nor did he call the principle a “razor.” In fact, the first known use of the term “Occam’s razor” occurs in 1852 in the work of the British mathematician William Rowan Hamilton. Although Ockham never even makes an argument for the validity of the principle, he uses it in many striking ways, and this is how it became associated with him.

For some, the principle of simplicity implies that the world is maximally simple. Aquinas, for example, argues that nature does not employ two instruments where one suffices. This interpretation of the principle is also suggested by its most popular formulation: “Entities should not be multiplied beyond necessity.” Yet this is a problematic assertion. We know today that nature is often redundant in both form and function. Although medieval philosophers were largely ignorant of evolutionary biology, they did affirm the existence of an omnipotent God, which is alone enough to render the assumption that the world is maximally simple suspicious. In any case, Ockham never makes this assumption and he does not use the popular formulation of the principle.

For Ockham, the principle of simplicity limits the multiplication of hypotheses not necessarily entities. Favoring the formulation “It is useless to do with more what can be done with less,” Ockham implies that theories are meant to do things, namely, explain and predict, and these things can be accomplished more effectively with fewer assumptions.

At one level, this is just common sense. Suppose your car suddenly stops running and your fuel gauge indicates an empty gas tank. It would be silly to hypothesize both that you are out of gas and that you are out of oil. You need only one hypothesis to explain what has happened.

Some would object that the principle of simplicity cannot guarantee truth. The gas gauge on your car may be broken or the empty gas tank may be just one of several things wrong with the car. In response to this objection, one might point out that the principle of simplicity does not tell us which theory is true but only which theory is more likely to be true. Moreover, if there is some other sign of damage, such as a blinking oil gage, then there is a further fact to explain, warranting an additional hypothesis.

Although the razor seems like common sense in everyday situations, when used in science, it can have surprising and powerful effects. For example, in his classic exposition of theoretical physics, A Brief History of Time, Stephen Hawking attributes the discovery of quantum mechanics to Ockham’s Razor.

Nevertheless, not everyone approves of the razor. Ockham’s contemporary and fellow Franciscan Walter Chatton proposed an “anti-razor” in opposition to Ockham. He declares that if three things are not enough to verify an affirmative proposition about things, a fourth must be added, and so on. Others call Ockham’s razor a “principle of stinginess,” accusing it of quashing creativity and imagination. Still others complain that there is no objective way to determine which of two theories is simpler. Often a theory that is simpler in one way is more complicated in another way. All of these concerns and others make Ockham’s razor controversial.

At bottom, Ockham advocates simplicity in order to reduce the risk of error. Every hypothesis carries the possibility that it may be wrong. The more hypotheses you accept, the more you increase your risk. Ockham strove to avoid error at all times, even if it meant abandoning well-loved, traditional beliefs. This approach helped to earn him his reputation as destroyer of the medieval synthesis of faith and reason.

3. Metaphysics: Nominalism

One of the most basic challenges in metaphysics is to explain how it is that things are the same despite differences. The Greek philosopher Heraclitus (540 - 480 B.C.E.) points out that you can never step into the same river twice, referring not just to rivers, but to places, people, and life itself. Every day everything changes a little bit and everywhere you go you find new things. Heraclitus concludes from such observations that nothing ever remains the same. All reality is in flux.

The problem with seeing the world this way is that it leads to radical skepticism: if nothing stays the same from moment to moment and from place to place, then we can never really be certain about anything. We can’t know our friends, we can’t know the world we live in, we can’t even know ourselves! Moreover, if Heraclitus is right, it seems science is impossible. We could learn the properties of a chemical here today and still have no basis for knowing its properties someplace else tomorrow.

Needless to say, most people would prefer to avoid skepticism. It’s hard to carry on in a state of complete ignorance. Besides, it seems obvious that science is not impossible. Studying the world really does enable us to know how things are over time and across distances. The fact that things change through time and vary from place to place does not seem to prevent us from having knowledge. From this, some philosophers, such as Plato and Augustine (354-430), draw the conclusion that Heraclitus was wrong to suppose that everything is in flux. Something stays the same, something that lays underneath the changing and varying surfaces we perceive, namely, the universal essence of things.

For example, although individual human beings change from day to day and vary from place to place, they all share the universal essence of humanity, which is eternally the same. Likewise for dogs, trees, rocks, and even qualities—there must be a universal essence of blueness, heat, love, and anything else one can think of. Universal essences are not physical realities; if you dissect a human being, you will not find humanity inside like a kidney or a lung! Nevertheless, universal essences are metaphysical realities: they provide the invisible structure of things.

Belief in universal essences is called “metaphysical realism,” because it asserts that universal essences are real even though we cannot physically see them. Although there are various different versions of metaphysical realism, they are all designed to secure a foundation for knowledge. It seems you have a choice: either you accept metaphysical realism or you are stuck with skepticism.

Ockham, however, argues that this is a false dilemma. He rejects metaphysical realism and skepticism in favor of nominalism: the view that universal essences are concepts in the mind. The word “nominalism” comes from the Latin word nomina, meaning name. Earlier nominalists such as the French philosopher Roscelin (1050-1125), had advanced the more radical view that universal essences are just names that have no basis in reality. Ockham developed a more sophisticated version of nominalism often called “conceptualism” because it holds that universal essences are concepts caused in our minds when we perceive real similarities among things in the world.

For example, when a child comes in contact with different human beings over time, he begins to form the concept of humanity. The realist would say that he has detected the invisible common structure of these individuals. Ockham, in contrast, insists that the child has merely perceived similarities that fit naturally under one concept.

It is tempting to assume that Ockham rejects metaphysical realism because of the principle of simplicity. After all, realism requires believing in invisible entities that might not actually exist. As a matter of fact, however, Ockham never uses the razor to attack realism. And on closer examination, this makes sense: the realist position is that the existence of universal essences is a hypothesis necessary to explain how science is possible. Since Ockham was just as concerned as everyone else to avoid skepticism, he might have been persuaded by such an argument.

Ockham has a much deeper worry about realism: he is convinced it is incoherent. Incoherence is the most serious charge a philosopher can level against a theory because it means that the theory contains a contradiction—and contradictions cannot be true. Ockham asserts that metaphysical realism cannot be true because it holds that a universal essence is one thing and many things at the same time. The form of humanity is one thing, because it is what all humans have in common, but it is also many things because it provides an invisible structure of each individual one of us. This is to say that it is both one thing and not one thing at the same time, which is a contradiction.

Realists claim that this apparent contradiction can be explained in various ways. Ockham insists, however, that no matter how you explain it, there is no way to avoid the fact that the notion of a universal essence is an impossible hypothesis. He writes,

There is no universal outside the mind really existing in individual substances or in the essences of things.... The reason is that everything that is not many things is necessarily one thing in number and consequently a singular thing. [Opera Philosophica II, pp. 11-12]

Ockham presents a thought experiment to prove universal essences do not exist. He writes that, according to realism, would follow that God would not be able to annihilate one individual substance without destroying the other individuals of the same kind. For, if he were to annihilate one individual, he would destroy the whole that is essentially that individual and, consequently, he would destroy the universal that is in it and in others of the same essence. Other things of the same essence would not remain, for they could not continue to exist without the universal that constitutes a part of them. [Opera Philosophica I, p. 51]

Since God is omnipotent, he should be able to annihilate a human being. But the universal form of humanity lies within that human being. So, by destroying the individual, he will destroy the universal. And if he destroys the universal, which is humanity, then he destroys all the other humans as well.

The realist may wish to reply that destroying an individual human destroys only part of the universal humanity. But this contradicts the original assertion that the universal humanity is a single shared essence that is eternally the same for everyone! For Ockham, this problem decisively defeats realism and leaves us with the nominalist alternative that universals are concepts caused in our minds when we perceive similar individuals. To support this alternative, Ockham develops an empiricist epistemology.

4. Epistemology

a. Direct Realist Empiricism

Epistemology is the study of knowledge: what is it, and how do we come to have it? There are two basic approaches to epistemology: rationalists claim that knowledge consists of innate certainties that we discover through reason; empiricists claim that knowledge consists in accurate perceptions that we accumulate through experience. Although early medieval philosophers such as Augustine and Anselm (1033-1109) were innatists, empiricism came to dominate during the high Middle Ages. This is mostly because Aristotle was an empiricist and the texts in which he promotes empiricism were rediscovered and translated for the first time into Latin during the thirteenth century.

Following Aristotle, Ockham asserts that human beings are born blank states: there are no innate certainties to be discovered in our minds. We learn by observing qualities in objects. Ockham’s version of empiricism is called “direct realism” because he denies that there is any intermediary between the perceiver and the world. (Note that direct realism should not be confused with metaphysical realism, which Ockham rejects, as discussed above.) Direct realism states that if you see an apple, its redness causes you to know that it is red. This may seem obvious, but it actually raises a problem that has led many empiricists, both in Ockham’s day and today, to reject direct realism.

As the French philosopher Peter Aureol (1275-1333) points out, the problem is that there are cases where we perceive something that is not really there. In optical illusions, hallucinations, and dreams, our perceptions are completely disconnected with the external world.

Representationalism is the version of empiricism designed to solve this problem. According to representationalists, human beings perceive the world through a mental mediary, or representation, known in the Middle Ages as the “intelligible species.” Normally, an apple causes an intelligible species of itself for us to perceive it through. In cases of optical illusions, hallucinations, and dreams, something else causes the intelligible species. The perception seems veridical to us because there is no difference in the intelligible species. Even before Peter Aureol, Thomas Aquinas advocated representationalism, and it soon became the dominant view.

The difficulty with representationalism, as the Irish philosopher George Berkeley (1685-1754) amply demonstrates, is that once you introduce an intermediary between the perceiver and the external world, you lose your justification for belief in the external world. If all of our ideas come through representations, how do we know what, if anything, is behind these representations? Something other than physical objects could be causing them. For example, God could be transmitting representations of physical objects to our minds without ever creating any physical objects at all—which is in fact what Berkeley came to believe. This view, known as idealism, is radically skeptical, and most philosophers prefer to avoid it.

b. Intuitive Cognition

Ockham preempts idealism through the notion of intuitive cognition, which plays a crucial role in his four-step account of knowledge acquisition. It can be summarized as follows. The first step is sensory cognition: receiving data through the five senses. This is an ability human beings share with animals. The second step, intuitive cognition, is uniquely human. Intuitive cognition is an awareness that the particular individual perceived exists and has the qualities it has. The third step is recordative cognition, by which we remember past perceptions. The fourth step is abstractive cognition, by which we place individuals in groups of similar individuals.

Notice that, if an apple is set in front of a horse, the horse will receive data about the apple—the color, the smell, etc.—and react appropriately. The horse will not, however, register the reality of the object. Suppose you project a realistic, laser image of an apple in front of the horse and he tries to take a bite. He will become frustrated, and eventually give up, but he will never really “get it.” Human beings, in contrast, have reality-sensitive minds. It’s not a matter of thinking “This is real” every time we see something. On the contrary, Ockham asserts that intuitive cognition is non-propositional. Rather, it is a matter of registering that the apple really has the qualities we perceive. Ockham writes:

Intuitive cognition is such that when some things are cognized, of which one inheres in the other, or one is spatially distant from the other, or exists in some relation to the other, immediately in virtue of that non-propositional cognition of those things, it is known if the thing inheres or does not inhere, if it is spatially distant or not, and the same for other true contingent propositions, unless that cognition is flawed or there is some impediment. [Opera Theologica I, p. 31]

While intuitive cognition is itself non-propositional, it provides the basis for formulating true propositions. A horse cannot say “This apple is red” because its mind is not complex enough to register the reality of what it perceives. The human mind, registering the existence of things—both that they are and how they are—can therefore formulate assertions about them.

Strictly speaking, when one has an intuitive cognition of an apple, one is not yet thinking of it as an apple, because this requires placing it in a group. In normal adult human perception, all four of the above steps happen together so quickly that it is hard to separate them. But try to imagine what perception is like for a toddler: she sees the round, red object and points to it saying “That!” This is an expression of intuitive cognition.

Intuitive cognition secures a causal link between the external world and the human mind. The human mind is entirely passive, according to Ockham, during intuitive cognition. Objects in the world cause us to be aware of their existence, and this explains and justifies our belief in them.

Despite his insistence on the causal link between the world and our minds, Ockham clearly recognizes cases in which intuitive cognition causes false judgment. (See the last line of the above quotation: “...unless that cognition is flawed or there is some impediment.”) For example, when you see a stick half-emerged in water, it looks bent. This is because your intuitive cognition of the stick is being affected by your simultaneous intuitive cognition of the water, and this causes a skewed perception. In addition to leaving room for error on his account, Ockham also leaves room for skepticism: God can transmit representations to human beings that seem exactly like intuitive cognitions.

Given that direct realism cannot rule out skepticism any more than representationalism can, one might wonder why Ockham prefers it. In the end, it is a question of simplicity. Whereas Ockham never uses his razor against metaphysical realism, he does use it against representationalism. Intuitive cognition is necessary to secure a causal link between the world and the mind, and, once it is in place, there is no need for a middle man. The intelligible species is an unnecessary hypothesis.

It is worth noting that intuitive cognition also provides epistemological support for Ockham’s nominalist metaphysics. Representationalists typically hold that the intelligible species emanates from the universal essence of the thing. In their view, you perceive an apple as an apple because the apple’s universal essence of appleness is conveyed to you through its intelligible species. In fact, many metaphysical realists would argue for the superiority of their view precisely on the grounds that universal essences provide a basis for intelligible species, and intelligible species are necessary for us to know what we are perceiving. They would ask: how else do we ever identify apples as apples instead of just so many distinct individuals?

As we have seen, Ockham argues that there is no universal essence. There is therefore no basis for an intelligible species. Each object in the world is an absolute individual and that is how we perceive it at first. Just like toddlers, we are bombarded with a buzzing, booming confusion of colors and sounds. But our minds are powerful sorting machines. We remember perceptions over time (recordative cognition) and organize them into groups (abstractive cognition). This organizational process gives us a coherent understanding of the world and is what Ockham aims to explain in his account of logic.

5. Logic

a. Mentalese

Although the human mind is born without any knowledge, according to Ockham, it does come fully equip with a system for processing perceptions as they are acquired. This system is thought, which Ockham understands in terms of an unspoken, mental language. He is therefore considered an advocate of “mentalese,” like the American philosopher Noam Chomsky.

Ockham might compare thought to a machine ready to manipulate a vast quantity of empty boxes. As we observe the world, perceptions are placed in the empty boxes. Then the machine sorts and organizes the boxes according to content. Two small boxes with similar contents might be placed together in a big box, and then the big box might be conjoined to another big box. For example, as perceptions of Rover and Fido accumulate, they become the concept dog, and then the concept dog is associated with the concept fleas. This conceptual apparatus enables us to construct meaningful sentences, such as “All dogs have fleas.”

The intuitive cognition in Ockham’s epistemology provides a basis for what is today called a “causal theory of reference” in philosophy of language. The word “dog” means dog because the concept you think of when you write it or say it was caused by the dogs you have perceived. Dogs cause the same kinds of concepts in all human beings. Thus, mentalese is universal among us, even though there are different ways to speak and write words in different countries around the world. While written and spoken language is conventional, signification itself is natural.

Early in his career, Ockham entertained the notion that concepts are mental objects or “ficta” which resemble objects in the world like pictures. He abandoned ficta theory, however, because it presupposes a representationalist epistemology, which in turn presupposes metaphysical realism. Arguing instead for “intellectum theory,” according to which objects can have causal impact on the mind without creating mental pictures of themselves; he offers the following analogy. Medieval pubs received wine in shipments of wooden barrels sealed with hoops. When the shipment arrived, the pub owner would hang a barrel hoop outside the front door to communicate to the townspeople that wine was available. Although the hoop did not resemble wine in any way, it was significant to the townspeople. This is because the presence of the hoop was caused by the arrival of the wine. Likewise, dogs in the world cause concepts in our minds that are significant even though they do not resemble dogs.

It must be noted that there is a drawback to both the barrel hoop analogy and the box illustration: they portray concepts as things. For convenience, Ockham often speaks of concepts loosely as though they were things. However, according to intellectum theory, concepts are not really things at all but rather actions. Perceiving a dog does not cause an entity to exist in your mind; rather, it causes a mental act. Today we would say that it causes a neuron to fire. Repeated acts cause a habit: the disposition to perform the act at will. So, repeated perceptions of dogs cause repeated acts of dog-conceiving and those repeated acts cause a dog-conceiving habit, meaning that you can engage in dog-conceiving actions whenever you want, even when there are no dogs around to perceive.

b. Supposition Theory

In Ockham’s view, any coherent thought we have requires connecting or disconnecting concepts by means of linguistic operators. Ockham has a lot of ideas about how the linguistic operators work, which he develops in his version of supposition theory. Although supposition theory was a major preoccupation of late medieval logicians, scholars are still divided over its purpose. Some think it was an effort to build a system of formal logic that ultimately failed. Others think it was more akin to a modern theory of logical form.

Ockham’s interest in supposition theory seems motivated by his concern to clarify conceptual confusion. Much like Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889-1951), Ockham asserts that many philosophical errors arise due to the misunderstanding of language. He took metaphysical realism to be a prime example. Conceiving of human beings in general leads us to use the word “humanity.” Metaphysical realists conclude that this word must refer to a universal essence within all human beings. For Ockham, however, the word “humanity” stands for a habit that enables us to conceive of all the human beings we have perceived to date in a very efficient manner: stripped of all of their individual details. In this way, Ockham’s supposition theory is designed to support his nominalist metaphysics while elucidating the rules of thought.

The word “supposition” comes from the Latin word “stand for” but it closely approximates the technical notion known as “reference” in English. At its most basic level, supposition theory tells us how words used in sentences, which Ockham calls “terms,” refer to things.

Medieval logicians recognize three types of supposition—material, personal and simple—but their metaphysical commitments affect their analyses. Most everyone agrees about material supposition. It occurs when a term is mentioned rather than used, as is the term “stop” in the sentence, “The sign says ‘stop.’” But they disagree over personal and simple supposition. For Ockham, personal supposition occurs when a term stands for an object in the world, as does the term “cat” in the sentence, “The cat is on the mat” and simple supposition occurs when a term stands for a concept in the mind, as does “horse” in the sentence, “Horse is a species.” For Ockham’s realist opponents, in contrast, the term “species” stands for a universal essence, which is an object in the world. They therefore have a different account of personal and simple supposition.

In addition to three types of supposition, medieval logicians recognize two types of terms: categorematic and syncategorematic. Categorematic terms refer to existing things and are called “categorematic” because, in his Organon, Aristotle asserts that there are ten categories of existing things. Syncategorematic terms do not refer to anything at all. They are logical operators, such as “all,” “not,” “if,” and “only,” which tell how to associate or disassociate the categorematic terms in a sentence.

Among categorematic terms, some are absolute names while others are connotative names. Ockham describes the difference as follows:

Properly speaking, only absolute names, that is, concepts signifying things composed of matter and form, have definitions expressing real essence. Some examples of this sort of name are “human being,” “lion,” and “goat.” Connotative and relative names, on the other hand, which signify one thing directly and another thing indirectly, have definitions expressing nominal essence. Some examples of this sort of name are “white,” “hot,” “parent,” and “child.” [Opera Philosophica IX, p. 554]

The terms “human being” and “parent” are both names for Betty. The term “human being” signifies Betty in an absolute way because it refers to her alone as an independently existing object. The term “parent” signifies Betty in a connotative way because it signifies her while at the same time signifying her children.

c. The Categories

Although the distinction between absolute and connotative terms seems minor, Ockham uses it for radical purposes. According to the standard reading of the Organon, Aristotle holds that there are ten categories of existing things as follows: substance, quality, quantity, relation, place, time, position, state, action, and passion. According to Ockham’s reading, however, Aristotle holds that there are only two categories of existing things: substance and quality. Ockham bases his interpretation on the thesis that only substances and qualities have real essence definitions signifying things composed of matter and form. The other eight categories signify a substance or a quality while connoting something else. They therefore have nominal essence definitions, meaning that they are not existing things.

Consider quantity. Suppose you have one orange. It is a substance with a real essence of citrus fruit. Furthermore, it possesses several qualities, such as its color, its flavor, and its smell. The orange and its qualities are existing things according to Ockham. But the orange is also singular. Is its singularity an existing thing? For mathematical Platonists, the answer is yes: the number one exists as a universal essence and inheres in the orange. Ockham, in contrast, asserts that the singularity of the orange is just a short hand way of saying that there are no other oranges nearby. So, in the sentence “Here is one orange” the term “one” is connotative: it directly signifies the orange itself while indirectly signifying all the other oranges that are not here. Ockham eliminates the rest of the categories along the same lines.

Interestingly, Ockham’s elimination of quantity precipitated his summons to Avignon because it pushed him to a new account of the sacrament of the altar. The sacrament of the altar is the miracle that is supposed to occur when bread and wine are transformed into the body and blood of Jesus Christ. This process is known in theology as “transubstantiation” because one substance changes into another substance. The problem is to explain why the bread and wine continue to look, smell, and taste exactly the same despite the underlying change. According to the standard account, the qualities of the bread and wine continue to inhere in their quantity, which remains the same while substances are exchanged. According to Ockham, however, quantity is nothing other than the substance itself; if the substance changes then the quantity changes. So, the qualities cannot continue to inhere in the same quantity. Nor can they transfer from the substance of the bread and wine into the substance of Jesus because it would be blasphemous to say that Jesus was crunchy or wet! Ockham’s solution is to claim that the qualities of the bread and wine continue to exist all by themselves, accompanying the invisible substance of Jesus down the gullet. Needless to say, this solution was a bit too clever.

One question scholars continue to ask is why Ockham allows for two of the ten categories to remain instead of just one, namely, substance. It seems that qualities, such as whiteness, crunchiness, sweetness, etc, can just as easily be reduced to nominal essences: they signify the substance itself while connoting the tongue or nose or eye that perceives it. Of course, if Ockham had eliminated quality, he really would have had no basis left for saving the miracle of transubstantiation. Perhaps that was reason enough to stay his razor.

6. Theology

a. Fideism

Despite his departures from orthodoxy and his conflict with the papacy, Ockham never renounced Catholicism. He steadfastly embraced fideism, the view that belief in God is a matter of faith alone. Although fideism was soon to become common among Protestant thinkers, it was not so common among medieval Catholics. At the beginning of the Middle Ages, Augustine proposed a proof of the existence of God and promoted the view that reason is faith seeking understanding. While the standard approach for any medieval philosopher would be to recognize a role for both faith and reason in religion, Ockham makes an uncompromising case for faith alone.

Three assertions reveal Ockham to be a fideist.

i. Theology is Not a Science

The word “science” comes from the Latin word “scientia,” meaning knowledge. In the first book of his Sentences, Peter Lombard raises the issue of whether and in what sense theology is a science. Most philosophers commenting on the Sentences found a way to cast faith as a way of knowing. Ockham, however, makes no such effort. As a staunch empiricist, Ockham is committed to the thesis that all knowledge comes from experience. Yet we have no experience of God. It follows inescapably that we have no knowledge of God, as Ockham affirms in the following passage:

In order to demonstrate the statement of faith that we formulate about God, what we would need for the central concept is a simple cognition of the divine nature in itself—what someone who sees God has. Nevertheless, we cannot have this kind of cognition in our present state. [Quodlibetal Questions, pp. 103-4]

By “present state” Ockham is referring to life on earth as a human being. Just as we now have knowledge of others through intuitive cognitions of their individual essences, those who go to heaven (if there ever are any such) will have knowledge of God through intuitive cognitions of his essence. Until then we can only hope.

ii. The Trinity is a Logical Contradiction

The Trinity is the core Christian doctrine according to which God is three persons in one. Christians traditionally consider the Trinity a mystery, meaning that it is beyond the comprehension of the human mind. Ockham goes so far as to admit that it is a blatant contradiction. He displays the problem through the following syllogism:

According to the doctrine of the Trinity:

(1) God is the Father,


(2) Jesus is God.

Therefore, by transitivity, according to the doctrine of the Trinity:

(3) Jesus is the Father.

Yet, according to the doctrine of the Trinity, Jesus is not the Father.

So, according to the doctrine of the Trinity, Jesus both is and is not the Father.

Providing precedent for a recent presidential defense, many medieval philosophers suggested that the transitive inference to the conclusion is broken by different senses of the word “is.” Scotus creatively argues that the logic of the Trinity is an opaque context that does not obey the usual rules. For Ockham, however, this syllogism establishes that theology is not logical and must never be mixed with philosophy.

iii. There Is No Evidence of Purpose in the Natural World

Living prior to the advent of Christianity, Aristotle never believed in the Trinity. He does, however, seem to believe in a supernatural force that lends purpose to all of nature. This is evident in his doctrine of the Four Causes, according to which every existing thing requires a fourfold explanation. Ockham would cast these four causes in terms of the following four questions:

First Cause: What is it made of?
Second Cause: What does it do?
Third Cause: What brought it about?
Fourth Cause: Why does it do what it does?

Most medieval philosophers found Aristotle’s four causes conducive to the Christian worldview, assimilating the fourth cause to the doctrine of divine providence, according to which everything that happens is ultimately part of God’s plan.

Though Ockham was reluctant to disagree with Aristotle, he was so determined to keep theology separate from science and philosophy, that he felt compelled to criticize the fourth (which he calls “final”) cause. Ockham writes,

If I accepted no authority, I would claim that it cannot be proved either from statements known in themselves or from experience that every effect has a final cause.... Someone who is just following natural reason would claim that the question “why?” is inappropriate in the case of natural actions. For he would maintain that it is no real question to ask something like, “For what reason is fire generated?” [Quodlibetal Questions, pp. 246-9]

No doubt Ockham put his criticism in hypothetical, third-person terms because he knew that openly asserting that the universe itself may be entirely purposeless would never pass muster with the powers that be.

b. Against the Proofs of God’s Existence

Needless to say, Ockham rejects all of the alleged proofs of the existence of God. Two of the most important proofs then, as now, were Anselm’s ontological proof and Thomas Aquinas’s cosmological proof. Although the former is based on rationalist thinking and the latter is based on empiricist thinking, they boil down to very similar strategies, in Ockham’s view. There were, of course, many different versions of each of these proofs circulating in Ockham’s day just as there are today. Ockham thinks that the most plausible version of each boils down to an infinite regress argument of the following form:

If God does not exist, then there is an infinite regress.
But infinite regresses are impossible.
Therefore, God must exist.

The reason Ockham finds this argument form to be the most plausible is that he fully agrees with the second premise, that infinite regresses are impossible. If it were possible to show that God’s non-existence implied an infinite regress, then Ockham would accept the inference to his existence. Ockham denies, however, that God’s non-existence implies any such thing.

In order to understand Ockham’s aversion to infinite regress, it is necessary to understand Aristotle’s distinction between extensive and intensive infinity. An extensive infinity is an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Mathematical Platonists conceive of the set of whole numbers as an extensive infinity. Ockham, however, deems the idea of an uncountable quantity contradictory: if the objects exist, then God can count them, and if God can count them, then they are not uncountable. An intensive infinity, on the other hand, is just a lack of limitation. As a nominalist, Ockham understands the set of whole numbers to be an intensive infinity in the sense that there is no upward limit on how far someone can count. This does not mean that the set of whole numbers are an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Ockham thinks that infinite regresses are impossible only in so far as they imply extensive infinity.

i. The Ontological Proof

According to Ockham, advocates of the ontological proof reason as follows: There would be an infinite regress among entities if there were not one greatest entity. Therefore, there must be one greatest entity, namely God.

One way to counter this reasoning would be to deny that greatness is an objectively existing quality. Ockham does not, however, take this approach. On the contrary, he seems to take the Great Chain of Being for granted. The Great Chain of Being is a doctrine prevalent throughout the Middle Ages and beyond. According to it, all of nature can be ranked on a hierarchy of value from top to bottom, roughly as follows: God, angels, humans, animals, plants, rocks. The Great Chain of Being implies that greatness is an objectively existing quality.

Ockham’s curt response to the ontological argument is that it does not prove that there is just one greatest entity. Bearing the Great Chain of Being in mind, it is evident what he means to say. If God and the angels do not exist, then human beings are the greatest entities, and there is no single best among us. Notice that, even if there were a single best among humans, he or she would be a “god” in a very different sense than is required by Catholic orthodoxy.

Some scholars have interpreted Ockham to mean that the ontological argument succeeds in proving that the Father, the Son, and the Holy Ghost exist, but not that they are one. It is not clear, however, how Ockham’s empiricism could permit such a conclusion.

ii. The Cosmological Proof

According to Ockham, advocates of the cosmological argument reason as follows: There would be an infinite regress among causes if there were not a first cause; therefore, there must be a first cause, namely, God.

There are two different ways to understand “cause” in this argument: efficient cause and conserving cause. An efficient cause brings about an effect successively over time. For example, your grandparents were the efficient cause of your parents who were the efficient cause of you. A conserving cause, in contrast, is a simultaneous support for an effect. For example, the oxygen in the room is a conserving cause of the burning flame on the candle.

In Ockham’s view, the cosmological argument fails using either type of causality. Consider efficient causality first. If the chain of efficient causes that have produced the world as we know it today had no beginning, then it would form, not an extensive infinity, but an intensive infinity, which is harmless. Since the links in the chain would not all exist at the same time, they would not constitute an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. Rather, they would simply imply that the universe is an eternal cycle of unlimited or perpetual motion. Ockham explicitly affirms that it is possible that the world had no beginning, as Aristotle maintained.

Next, consider conserving causality. Conceiving of the world as a product of simultaneous conserving causes is difficult. The idea is perhaps best expressed in a story reported by Stephen Hawking. According to the story, a scientist was giving a lecture on astronomy. After the lecture, an elderly lady came up and told the scientist that he had it all wrong. “The world is really a flat plate supported on the back of a giant tortoise.” The scientist asked “And what is the turtle standing on?” To which the lady triumphantly replied: “You’re very clever, young man, but it’s no use – it’s turtles all the way down.”

Ockham readily grants that if the world has to be “held up” by conserving causes, then there must be a first among them because otherwise the set of conserving causes would constitute an uncountable quantity of actually existing things. It is in fact a tenet of belief that God is both an efficient and conserving cause of the cosmos, and Ockham accepts this tenet on faith. He handily points out, however, that, just as the cosmos need not have a beginning; it need not be “held up” in this way at all. Each existing thing may be its own conserving cause. Hence the cosmological argument is entirely inconclusive.

Ockham’s fideism amounts to a refusal to rely on the God hypothesis for theory building. It is worth bearing in mind that there were no philosophy departments or philosophy degrees in the Middle Ages. A student’s only choices for graduate school were law, medicine, or theology. Wanting to be a philosopher, Ockham studied theology and ran through his theological exercises, all the while trying to carve out a separate space for philosophy. The one area where the two worlds collide inextricably for him is in ethics.

7. Ethics

a. Divine Command Theory

Many people think God commands human beings to be kind because kindness is good and that God himself is always kind because his actions are always in conformity with goodness.

Although this was and still is the most common way of conceiving of the relationship between God and morality, Ockham disagrees. In his view, God does not conform to an independently existing standard of goodness; rather, God himself is the standard of goodness. This means it is not the case that God commands us to be kind because kindness is good. Rather, kindness is good because God commands it. Ockham was a divine command theorist: God’s will establishes right and wrong.

Divine command theory has always been unpopular because it carries one very unintuitive implication: if whatever God commands becomes right, and God can command whatever he wants, then God could command us always to be unkind and never to be kind, and then it would be right for us to be unkind and wrong for us to be kind. Kindness would be bad and unkindness would be good! How could this be?

In Ockham’s view, God always has commanded and always will command kindness. Nevertheless, it is possible for him to command otherwise. This possibility is a straightforward requirement of divine omnipotence: God can do anything that does not involve a contradiction. Of course, plenty of philosophers, such as Thomas Aquinas, insist that it is impossible for God to command us to be unkind simply because then God’s will would contradict his nature. For Ockham, however, this is the wrong way to conceive of God’s nature. The most important thing to understand about God’s nature, in Ockham’s view, is that it is maximally free. There are no constraints, external or internal, to what God can will. All of theology stands or falls with this thesis in Ockham’s view.

Ockham grants that it is hard to imagine a world in which God reverses his commands. Yet this is the price of preserving divine freedom. He writes,

I reply that hatred, theft, adultery, and the like may involve evil according to the common law, in so far as they are done by someone who is obligated by a divine command to perform the opposite act. As far as everything absolute in these actions is concerned, however, God can perform them without involving any evil. And they can even be performed meritoriously by someone on earth if they should fall under a divine command, just as now the opposite of these, in fact, fall under a divine command. [Opera Theologica V, p. 352]

One advantage of this approach is that it enables Ockham to make sense of some instances in the Old Testament where it looks as though God is commanding such things as murder (as in the case of Abraham sacrificing Isaac) and deception (as in the case of the Israelites despoiling the Egyptians). But biblical exegesis is not Ockham’s motive. His motive is to cast God as a paradigm of metaphysical freedom, so that he can make sense of human nature as made in his image.

b. Metaphysical Libertarianism

Metaphysical libertarianism is the view that human beings are responsible for their actions as individuals because they have free will, defined as the ability to do other than they do. Metaphysical libertarianism is opposed to determinism, according to which human beings do not have free will but rather are determined by antecedent conditions (such as God or nature or environmental factors) to do exactly what they do.

Suppose Jake eats a cupcake. According to the determinist, antecedent conditions caused him to do this. Hence, he could not have done otherwise unless those antecedent conditions had been different. Given the same conditions, Jake cannot refrain from eating the cupcake. Determinists are content to conclude that freedom is an illusion.

Compatibilism is a version of determinism according to which being determined to do exactly what we do is compatible with freedom as long as the antecedent conditions that determine what we do include our own choices. Compatibilists claim that the choices we make are free even though we could not do otherwise given the same antecedent conditions. On this view, Jake chose to eat the cupcake because his desire for it outweighed all other considerations at that moment. Our choices are always determined by our strongest desires according to compatibilists.

Metaphysical libertarians reject determinism and compatibilism, insisting that free will includes the ability to act against our strongest desires. On this view, Jake could have refrained from eating the cupcake even given the exact same antecedent conditions. While desires influence our choices they do not cause our choices according to metaphysical libertarianism; rather, our choices are caused by our will which is itself an uncaused cause, meaning that it is an independent power, stronger than any antecedent condition. This notion of free will enables the metaphysical libertarian to assign a very strong conception of individual responsibility to human beings: what we do is not attributable to God or nature or environmental factors.

Many people make the assumption that all medieval philosophers were metaphysical libertarians. Whereas Protestant theology classically promotes theological determinism, the view that everything human beings do is foreordained by God, Catholic theology classically promotes the view that God gave human beings free will. While it is true that every medieval philosopher endorses the thesis that human beings are free, few are able to maintain a commitment to free will, defined as the ability to do other than we do given the same antecedent conditions. The reason is that so many other theological and philosophical doctrines conflict with it.

Consider divine foreknowledge. If God is omniscient, then he knows everything that you are ever going to do. Suppose he knows that you will eat an apple for lunch tomorrow. How then is it possible for you to choose not to eat an apple for lunch tomorrow? Even if God does not force you in any way, it seems his present knowledge of your future requires that your choices are already determined.

Medieval philosophers struggle with this and other conflicts with free will. Most give up on metaphysical libertarianism in favor of some form of compatibilism. This is to say they maintain that our choices are free even though they are determined by antecedent conditions.

In his Sentences Commentary, Peter John Olivi makes a long and impassioned argument for an unadulterated metaphysical libertarian conception of free will. Ockham embraces Olivi’s position without ever making much of an argument for it. In Ockham’s view, we experience freedom. We can no more dismiss this experience than we can dismiss our experience of the external world. Ockham goes to great lengths to adjust his account of divine foreknowledge and anything else that might otherwise threaten free will in order to accommodate it. He writes,

The will is freely able to will something and not to will it. By this I mean that it is able to destroy the willing that it has and produce anew a contrary effect, or it is equally able in itself to continue that same effect and not produce a new one. It is able to do all of this without any prior change in the intellect, or in the will, or in something outside them. The idea is that the will is equal for producing and not producing because, with no difference in antecedent conditions, it is able to produce and not to produce. It is poised equally over contrary effects in such a way in fact, that it is able to cause love or hatred of something.... To deny every agent this equal or contrary power is to destroy every praise and blame, every council and deliberation, every freedom of the will. Indeed, without it, the will would not make a human being free any more than appetite does an ass. [Opera Philosophica, pp. 319-21]

Ockham’s reference to an ass here is significant in connection with the famous thought experiment known as Buridan’s Ass.

Jean Buridan was a younger contemporary of Ockham’s. Although he embraced and elaborated Ockham’s nominalism, he openly rejected metaphysical libertarianism, arguing that the human intellect determines the human will. He may have engaged in a public debate with Ockham over the nature of human freedom. At any rate, his name somehow became associated with the following thought experiment.

Imagine a hungry donkey poised between two equally delicious piles of hay. The donkey has reason to eat the hay, but because he caught sight of both piles at the same time, he has no more reason to approach one pile than the other. For lack of any way to break the tie, the donkey starves to death. A human being, in contrast, would never make such an ass of himself. The reason is that, in human beings, the will is not determined by the intellect. Free will is the uniquely human dignity that enables us to break the tie between two equally reasonable options.

The French philosopher Pierre Bale (1647-1706) is the first on record to call this thought experiment “Buridan’s Ass.” Although Buridan mentions the case of a dog poised between food and water, he never discusses the case of the donkey in connection with freedom. It is therefore somewhat of a puzzle why the thought experiment is named after him. Interestingly, Peter John Olivi does discuss the case of the donkey in connection with freedom, and we see Ockham echoing that text here.

So, in the end, Ockham’s ethics is dictated by his empiricism. We experience free will. Therefore, free will is at the core of human nature. Theology tells us that we are made in God’s image. Therefore, free will is at the core of God’s nature. But theology also tells us that God is always good. Therefore, God’s free will must be the objective determinant of goodness.

Setting aside his divine command theory, Ockham’s ethics is rather unremarkable, coming to more or less the same thing as that of his colleagues who reject divine command theory. One might think Ockham takes a long way around the barn just to arrive at yet another conventional account of Christian virtue! But Ockham never minds taking the long way around for the sake of consistency. We see the same unflagging determination in his political theory

8. Political Theory

Although Ockham was summoned to the papal court in Avignon to defend a number of “suspect theses” extracted from his work, largely concerning the sacrament of the altar, he was never found guilty of heresy, and his conflict with the papacy ultimately had nothing to do with the sacrament of the altar. While staying in Avignon, Ockham met Michael Cesena (1270-1342), the Minister General of the Franciscan Order, who was there in protest of the Pope’s recent pronouncements about the Franciscan vow of poverty. Michael asked Ockham to study these pronouncements, whereupon Ockham joined the protest and soon became irretrievably entangled in a political imbroglio. Leaving academia behind for good, he nevertheless marshaled his central philosophical insights into the debate. While Ockham was not allowed to publish his political treatises, they circulated widely underground, indirectly influencing major developments in political thought.

a. Rights

Who would have guessed that at the root of these developments lay the Franciscan vow of poverty? In Matthew 19, Jesus says to a man, “If you wish to be perfect, go, sell all you have, give your money to the poor, and come, and follow me.” The man who was to become St. Francis of Assisi (1182-1226) took these instructions personally. Raised in a wealthy family, St. Francis gave up the worldly life, founding the Order of the Friar Minor, and requiring all its members to take a vow of poverty. From the very beginning there was controversy over what exactly this vow entailed. By the 1320s, various factions had come to the breaking point.

Michael Cesena promoted the “radical” interpretation, according to which Franciscans should not only live simply but also own nothing, not even the robes on their backs. Pope Nicholas III (1210/1220-1280) had sanctioned this interpretation by arranging for the papacy officially to possess everything that the Franciscans used, including the very food they ate. Living in absolute poverty enabled the Franciscans to preach convincingly against avarice, and, much to the chagrin of Pope John XXII (1244-1334), raise questions about the ever-expanding papal palace in Avignon.

John was determined to amass great wealth for the church and the Franciscan vow of poverty was getting in the way. Trained as a lawyer, John worked up a good argument for revoking Nicholas’s arrangement. Given that the Franciscans enjoyed exclusive use of the donations they received, they were the de facto owners. Papal “ownership” of Franciscan property was ownership in name alone.

As a nominalist, however, Ockham was in an excellent position to show why reducing something to a name is not the same as reducing it to nothing at all. A name is a mental concept, and a mental concept is an intention. Ockham set out to show that the intention to use is distinct from the intention to own.

Ockham derives his definition of ownership from metaphysical libertarianism. Ownership is not just a conventional relationship established through social agreement. It is a natural relationship that arises through the act of making something of your own free will. Free will naturally confers ownership because it implies sole responsibility. Suppose you freely make a choice. Since you could have done otherwise, you are the true cause of the result. To own something is to do what you will with it.

The Franciscans do not do as they will with the donations given to them, according to Ockham, but rather as the owner wills. They are therefore merely using the donations and do not own them. Granted, in normal practice, this distinction may be entirely undetectable, because the will of the owner matches that of the user. But if a conflict of wills should arise, the distinction would become readily apparent. Suppose someone donates some cloth to the Order intending it to be used for robes. The friars must use it for robes even if they would rather use it for something else. And if the donor wants the cloth back even after it is made into robes, the friars will have no basis for refusing and no legal recourse. Ockham puts the crucial point in terms of crucial language: the owner retains a right (ius) to what he owns.

The notion of a right is one of the most important features of modern political theory. Its emergence in the history of Western thought is a long and complicated story. Nevertheless, the Franciscan poverty debate is standardly considered an important watershed, in which Ockham played a significant role.

b. Separation of Church and State

Ockham extends his commitment to poverty beyond just the Franciscan order, convinced that wealth is an inappropriate source of power for the Catholic Church as a whole. In his view, the Catholic Church has a spiritual power which sets it apart from the secular world. This conviction leads Ockham to propose the doctrine that was to become the foundation of the United States Constitution: separation of church and state.

Throughout the Middle Ages, popes and emperors vied for supremacy across Europe. The political momentum was split in two directions and it was not at all clear which way things would go. One side pushed for hierocracy, where the pope, as the highest authority, appoints the emperor. The other side pushed for imperialism, where the emperor, as the highest authority, appoints the pope. Often the pushing came to shoving; it seemed there would be no end to the ill will and bloodshed.

Ockham boldly proposes a third alternative: the pope and the emperor should be separate but equal, each supreme in his own domain. This was an outrageous suggestion, unwelcome on both sides. Ockham’s argument for it stems from reflections that foreshadow the “state of nature” thought experiments of premier modern political theorists Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679), John Locke (1632-1704) and Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712-1778).

In the Garden of Eden, God gave the earth to human beings to use to their common benefit. As long as we were willing to share there was no need for property among us. After the fall, however, human beings became selfish and exploitative. Laws became necessary to restrain immoderate appetite for secular or “temporal” goods and to prevent the neglect of their management. Since laws are useless without the ability to enforce them, we arrived at the need for secular power. The function of the secular power is to punish law breakers and in general coerce everyone into obeying the law.

By renouncing property, the Franciscans were attempting to live as God originally intended. In a perfect world, there would be no need for property and the coercive authority it spawns. All Christians should aspire to this anarchic utopia, even though they may never fully achieve it. In the meanwhile, they should avoid mixing the spiritual and the secular as much as possible. Ockham writes,

For this reason, the head of Christians does not, as a rule, have power to punish secular wrongs with a capital penalty and other bodily penalties and it is for thus punishing such wrongs that temporal power and riches are chiefly necessary; such punishment is granted chiefly to the secular power. The pope therefore, can, as a rule, correct wrongdoers only with a spiritual penalty. It is not, therefore, necessary that he should excel in temporal power or abound in temporal riches, but it is enough that Christians should willingly obey him. [A Letter to the Friars Minor and other Writings, p. 204]

For Ockham, the separation of church and state is a separation of the ideal and the real.

Ockham mentions democracy only in passing, arguing in favor of monarchy as the best form of secular government. Moreover, he finds representational forms of government objectionable on the grounds that there is no such thing as a common will. Ockham is not holding out for a superhuman leader. On the contrary, he seems to think that a fairly ordinary, good man can make a decent king. One wonders if Louis of Bavaria, to whose protection he and Michael fled, inspired this confidence. Perhaps Ockham is content with monarchy because, in his view, the secular world will always be intrinsically flawed. He sets his hopes instead on the spiritual world, and this is why he was so bitterly disappointed in Pope John XXII.

c. Freedom of Speech

Ockham’s battle with the papacy continued after John’s death through two successive popes. Although Ockham never came to criticize the institution of the papacy itself, as would later Protestant thinkers, he did accuse the popes he opposed of heresy and called for their expulsion. Ironically, Ockham’s extensive analysis of the concept of heresy turns into a defense of free speech.

In keeping with his doctrine of the separation of church and state, Ockham maintains that the pope, and only the pope, has the right to level spiritual penalties, and only spiritual penalties, against someone who knowingly asserts theological falsehoods and refuses to be corrected. A man might unknowingly assert a theological falsehood a thousand times, however. As long as he is willing to be corrected, he should not be judged a heretic, especially by the pope.

Ockham’s political treatises are strewn with biblical exegesis, often glaringly ad hoc and sometimes quite interesting, as in the present case. In Matthew 28:20 Jesus promises his disciples: “I will be with you always, to the end of the age.” This text traditionally provided justification for the doctrine of papal infallibility according to which the pope cannot be wrong when speaking about official church matters. Ockham rejects this doctrine, however, arguing that the minimum required for Jesus to keep his promise is that one human being remain faithful at any given time, and this one could be anyone, even a single baptized infant. This implies that the entire institution of the church could become completely corrupt. As a result, any theological claim, no matter how ancient or universally accepted, is always open for dispute.

Even more interesting, however, is Ockham’s view of non-theological speech. He writes that

...purely philosophical assertions which do not pertain to theology should not be solemnly condemned or forbidden by anyone, because in connection with such assertions anyone at all ought to be free to say freely what pleases him, [Dialogus, I.2.22]

This statement long predates the Areopagitica of John Milton (1608-1674), which is typically heralded as the earliest defense of free speech in Western history.

Ockham’s contributions in political thought are less known and appreciated than they may have been if he had been able to publish them. Likewise, there is no telling what he might have accomplished in philosophy if he had been allowed to carry on with his academic career. Ockham was ahead of his time. His role in history was to make way for new ideas, boldly planting seeds that grew and flourished after his death.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Ockham’s Works in Latin

  • William of Ockham, 1967-88. Opera philosophica et theologica. Gedeon Gál, et al., ed. 17 vols. St. Bonaventure, N. Y.: The Franciscan Institute.
  • William of Ockham, 1956-97. Opera politica. H. S. Offler, et al. ed. 4 vols. Vols. 1-3, Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1956-74. Vol. 4, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997.
  • William of Ockham, 1995-still in progress. Dialogus. John Kilcullen and John Scott, et al. ed. & trans.

b.Ockham’s Works in English Translation

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, and Norman Kretzmann, trans. 1983. William of Ockham: Predestination, God’s Foreknowledge, and Future Contingents. 2nd ed. Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Birch, T. Bruce, ed. & trans. 1930. The De sacramento altaris of William of Ockham. Burlington, Iowa: Lutheran Literary Board.
  • Boehner, Philotheus, ed. & trans. 1990. William of Ockham: Philosophical Writings. Rev. ed. Indianapolis, Ind.: Hackett.
  • Davies, Julian, trans. 1989. Ockham on Aristotle’s Physics: A Translation of Ockham’s Brevis Summa Libri Physicorum. St. Bonaventure, N. Y.: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Freddoso, Alfred J., and Francis E. Kelly, trans. 1991. Quodlibetal Questions. New Haven, Conn.: Yale University Press.
  • Freddoso, Alfred J., and Henry Schuurman, trans. 1980. Ockham’s Theory of Propositions: Part II of the Summa logicae. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kilcullen, John, and John Scott, ed. & trans. 1995-still in progress. Dialogue on the Power of the Emperor and the Pope.
  • Kluge, Eike-Henner W., trans. 1973-74. “William of Ockham’s Commentary on Porphyry: Introduction and English Translation.” Franciscan Studies 33, pp. 171-254, and 34, pp. 306-82.
  • Loux, Michael J. 1974. Ockham’s Theory of Terms: Part I of the Summa Logicae. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • McGrade, A. S., and John Kilcullen, ed. & trans. 1992. A Short Discourse on the Tyrannical Government over Things Divine and Human. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • McGrade, A. S., and John Kilcullen, ed. & trans. 1995. A Letter to the Friars Minor and Other Writings. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Spade, Paul Vincent, 1994. Five Texts on the Mediaeval Problem of Universals: Porphyry, Boethius, Abelard, Duns Scotus, Ockham. Indianapolis, Ind.: Hackett.
  • Wood, Rega, trans. 1997. Ockham on the Virtues. West Lafayette, Ind.: Purdue University Press.

c. Books about Ockham

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord, 1987. William Ockham. 2 vols., Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press. (2nd rev. ed., 1989.)
  • Copleston, F.C., 1953. History of Philosophy, Volume III: Ockham to Suarez. London: Search Press.
  • Goddu, André, 1984. The Physics of William of Ockham. Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Hirvonen, Vesa, 2004. Passions in William Ockham’s Philosophical Psychology. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Kaye, Sharon M. and Robert Martin, 2001. On Ockham. Belmont: Wadsworth.
  • Maurer, Armand, 1999. The Philosophy of William of Ockham in the Light of its Principles. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
  • McGrade, A. S., 1974. The Political Thought of William of Ockham. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Spade, Paul, ed., 1999. The Cambridge Companion to Ockham. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Panaccio, Claude, 2004. Ockham on Concepts. Burlington: Ashgate.
  • Tauchau, Katherine H., 1988. Vision and Certitude in the Age of Ockham: Optics, Epistemology and the Foundations of Semantics, 1250-1345. Leiden: E. J. Brill.

Author Information

Sharon Kaye
John Carroll University
U. S. A.

Richard Rorty (1931—2007)

RortyRichard Rorty was an important American philosopher of the late twentieth and early twenty-first century who blended expertise in philosophy and comparative literature into a perspective called "The New Pragmatism" or “neopragmatism.” Rejecting the Platonist tradition at an early age, Rorty was initially attracted to analytic philosophy. As his views matured he came to believe that this tradition suffered in its own way from representationalism, the fatal flaw he associated with Platonism. Influenced by the writings of Darwin, Gadamer, Hegel and Heidegger, he turned towards Pragmatism.

Rorty’s thinking as a historicist and anti-essentialist found its fullest expression in 1979 in his most noted book, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Abandoning all claims to a privileged mental power that allows direct access to things-in-themselves, he offered an alternative narrative which adapts Darwinian evolutionary principles to the philosophy of language. The result was an attempt to establish a thoroughly naturalistic approach to issues of science and objectivity, to the mind-body problem, and to concerns about the nature of truth and meaning. In Rorty’s view, language is to be employed as an adaptive tool used to cope with the natural and social environments to achieve a desired, pragmatic end.

Motivating his entire program is Rorty’s challenge to the notion of a mind-independent, language-independent reality that scientists, philosophers, and theologians appeal to when professing their understanding of the truth. This greatly influences his political views. Borrowing from Dewey’s writings on democracy, especially where he promotes philosophy as the art of the politically useful leading to policies that are best, Rorty ties theoretical inventiveness to pragmatic hope. In place of traditional concerns about whether what one believes is well-grounded, Rorty, in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), advises that it is better to focus on whether one has been imaginative enough to develop interesting alternatives to one’s present beliefs. His assumption is that in a foundationless world, creative, secular humanism must replace the quest for an external authority (God, Nature, Method, and so forth) to provide hope for a better future. He characterizes that future as being free from dogmatically authoritarian assertions about truth and goodness. Thus, Rorty sees his New Pragmatism as the legitimate next step in completing the Enlightenment project of demystifying human life, by ridding humanity of the constricting "ontotheological" metaphors of past traditions, and thereby replacing the power relations of control and subjugation inherent in these metaphors with descriptions of relations based on tolerance and freedom.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Thoughts and Work
  3. Major Influences
    1. Hegel’s Historicism as Protopragmatism
    2. Darwin’s Evolution
    3. Heidegger: Contingency over Certainty
    4. Dewey’s Pragmatic Democracy
    5. Davidson on Truth and Meaning
  4. Positions
    1. Overview
    2. Philosophy: Neither Realism nor Antirealism
    3. Anti-essential Nominalism
    4. Anti-foundationalist Historicism
    5. Ethnocentricism
    6. Philosophy as Metaphor
    7. Anti-representational Metaphilosophy
    8. Pragmatic Pluralism
    9. Solidarities, Poets, and the Jeffersonian Strategy
    10. Non-reductive Materialism and the Self
  5. Critics
    1. Hilary Putnam, John McDowell, and James Conant
    2. Donald Davidson and Bjorn Ramberg
    3. Daniel Dennett
    4. Jurgen Habermas, Nancy Fraser, and Norman Geras
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. a. Works by Rorty
    2. b. Works about Rorty
    3. c. Further Reading

1. Life

Richard McKay Rorty was born on October 4, 1931 in New York City. He held teaching positions at Yale University from 1954 to 1956, Wellesley College from 1958 to 1961, Princeton University from 1961 to 1982, and the University of Virginia since 1982. In addition he has held many visiting positions.

As he relates in his autobiographical piece, "Trotsky and the Wild Orchids," Rorty’s early and informal education began with the books in his parents' library, particularly Leon Trotsky’s two books History of the Russian Revolution and Literature and Revolution as well as two volumes on the Dewey Commission of Inquiry into the Moscow Trials. These materials, along with his family’s association with noted socialists such as John Frank and Carlo Tresca, introduced Rorty to the plight of oppressed peoples and the fight for social justice.

At the age of fifteen in 1946, Rorty entered the University of Chicago where he eventually earned B.A. and M.A. degrees. After initially embracing Platonism and its replacement of passion by reason as a method to harmonize reality with the ideals of justice, a reluctant Rorty came to hold that this rapprochement was impossible. Opting rather for the rigors of the study of the philosophy of mind and analytic philosophy, Rorty left Chicago for Yale University, where he received his Ph.D. degree in 1956. He developed the theory of eliminativism materialism in "Mind-body Identity, Privacy and Categories" (1965), The Linguistic Turn (1967) and "In Defense of Eliminative Materialism" (1970). Here he clarifies and adjusts his commitment to the analytic tradition, a commitment that began with his Ph.D. dissertation “The Concept of Potentiality.” He eventually was to become disenchanted with analytic philosophy.

After reading Hegel’s Phenomenology of the Spirit, Rorty began to appreciate the degree to which the incessant conflict of philosophers and their competing first principles might, with the cunning of reason, be transformed from a seemingly interminable debate into a conversation that weaves itself into a “conceptual fabric of a freer, better, more just society.” This appreciation matured with Rorty’s study of Heidegger’s works.

During his tenure at Princeton University, Rorty was reintroduced to the works of John Dewey that he had set aside for his studies on Plato. It was this reacquaintance with Dewey, along with an acquaintance with the writings of Wilfrid Sellars and W. V. Quine that caused Rorty to redirect his interest to the study and development of the American philosophy of Pragmatism.

The publication of his first book, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature in 1979, the same year he became President of the American Philosophical Association, publicly marked Rorty’s thorough break with Platonic essentialism as well as with Cartesian foundationalism. He attacked assumptions at the core of modern epistemology—the conceptions of mind, of knowledge and of the discipline of philosophy.

Calling himself “raucously secularist,” Rorty rejected contemporary attempts at holding justice and reality in a single vision, declaring this to be a remnant of what Heidegger called the ontotheological tradition whose metaphors had frozen into dogmatic truisms about truth and goodness. In Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), Rorty extended this claim by abandoning all pretenses to an analytic style. Opting for a Proust-inspired narrative approach where arguments for universal rights, common humanity, and justice are replaced with references to pain and humiliation as motivation for society to form solidarities (contingent groupings of like-minded individuals) in opposition to suffering, Rorty substituted hope for knowledge as the main thrust of his efforts. Tolerant conversations rather than philosophical debates and idiosyncratic re-creation rather than self-discovery have been hallmarks of his pragmatic pursuit for social hope, the pursuit of which can be characterized as a historicist quest for human happiness that abandons a search for universal truth and timeless goodness in favor of what works. Rorty’s pragmatic aim was and continues to be the development of a liberal society where there is freedom from pain and humiliation and where open-mindedness is practiced.

More recently, Rorty developed his notion of the uses of philosophy by using as his template a reading of Darwinian evolution applied to Deweyan democratic principles. This development appears most notably in Achieving Our Country (1998), Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers III (1998) and in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999). Rorty died on June 8, 2007.

2. Thoughts and Work

The failure of Rorty’s youthful attempt to synthesize into one vision his identification with the downtrodden together with his search for the "Truth beyond hypothesis" was the making of his career in philosophy. As early as 1967, Rorty had moved away from an initial interest in linguistic philosophy as a way of finding a neutral standpoint from which to establish a strict science of language, and he began his shift to pragmatism. With the publication of Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979), Rorty further elucidated his maturing anti-essentialist, historicist positions as applied to topics such as the philosophy of science and the mind-body problem, as well as the philosophy of language as it pertained to issues of truth and meaning. With Consequences of Pragmatism (1982), Rorty developed in greater detail the themes covered in his 1979 work.

With Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), Rorty first implicitly linked his rejection of philosophical appeals to ahistorical universals with that of his pragmatist narrative, a narrative of free, idiosyncratic individuals who, inspired by intuitions and sensibilities captured in great works of literature, commit themselves to contingent solidarities devoted to social and political liberalism. Furthermore, these individuals, detached from the need to justify their world-view by an appeal to the way the world is, would see moral obligation as a matter of social conditioning by cultural forces, which are in turn structured by the prevalent human needs and desires of a specific era.

In Part III of Objectivity, Relativism and Truth (1991), Rorty continued to develop his pragmatist views on politics in a democratic society. In Parts I and II he set his sights on contemporary ideas about objectivity, using the writings of Donald Davidson and others for support in debunking the claim that the human mind is capable of discovering ahistorical truth concerning the nature and meaning of reality from a “God’s-eye,” ideal perspective. Supporting the entire work is Rorty’s challenge to the notion of a mind-independent, language-independent reality to which scientists, philosophers, and politicians appeal when professing that they have a corner on the truth. His Essays on Heidegger and Others (1991) is devoted to harmonizing the works of Heidegger and Derrida with the writings of Dewey and Davidson, particularly in their anti-representational insights and stances on contingent historicism.

Later writings, such as Truth and Progress (1998); Achieving our Country: Leftist Thoughts in Twentieth-Century America (1998); and Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), clarify his anti-essentialist stance by integrating a neo-Darwinian perspective into a Dewey-inspired pragmatism.

3. Major Influences

Although the writing of any philosopher will have countless influences, there are generally only a handful which stand out as major inspirations. Rorty is no exception. While Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, Derrida, James, Quine, and Kuhn contribute much to his worldview, of central importance to Rorty’s narrative of New Pragmatism are five influential thinkers: G. W. F. Hegel, Charles Darwin, Martin Heidegger, John Dewey, and Donald Davidson, each contributing a significant layer to Rorty’s complex take on questions central to contemporary philosophy.

a. Hegel’s Historicism as Protopragmatism

It was G. W. F. Hegel’s willingness in his Phenomenology of the Spirit (1977) to abandon certainty and eternity as philosophical and moral goals/ideals that inspired Rorty to appreciate the irreducible temporality of everything as well as to understand philosophy as a contingent narrative readable without a moral precept existing behind the storyline. Calling Hegel’s switch from the metaphor of individual salvation through contact with a transcendental reality to salvation through the achievement of the completion of an historical process “protopragmatism,” Rorty asserts that this move was a critical step forward in human thinking, taking us from the notion of how things were meant to be to a perspective on how things never were but might be. The change of focus from epistemological stasis, the adequate discernment of God’s Will or Nature’s Way, to interpretive processes opened the way for subsequent intellectuals to envision their task as that of constructing a better future rather than the discovery and conforming to a static idea of the Good Life. The refocused purpose of philosophy, from Rorty’s perspective, would be best captured by Hegel’s phrase “time held in thought,” that is, a narrative of a community’s progress across time that can be described in terms of its current and parochial needs; societal growth not measured against some non-human, eternal standard. Thus, Rorty contends, Hegel helped us to begin to substitute pragmatic hope for apodictic knowledge.

Of course, Hegel saw his own philosophical efforts as elucidating the progression by which the rational becomes real. That is, he conceived history as the process of the Absolute becoming increasingly self-manifest (the Incarnate Logos) through the development toward, and concrete realization in, the human consciousness. This Rorty rejects as a form of pantheistic fantasy that attempts to maintain a “closeness of fit” between word and world by rendering humanity as the mere manifestation of the Divine Mind, and one that is not consistent, ironically, with Hegel’s own anti-representational doctrine of historicism. To address this inconsistency and for a corrective to Hegel’s Absolute Idealism, Rorty turns to Charles Darwin.

b. Darwin’s Evolution

In 1998 Rorty contended that Darwin has demonstrated how to naturalize Hegel by the former’s dispensing with claims that the real is rational while allowing for a narrative of change understood as an endless series of progressive unfolding. Purpose that transcends a given organism is eliminated in favor of a particular organism’s fitness for the local environment. It is an evolutionary process, one that fully involves human beings; we are no exception. What we, as creatures of the earth, do and are, Rorty maintains, “is continuous with what amoebas, spiders, and squirrels do and are.” Consciousness and thought are not distinct kinds; they are inextricably linked to the use of language. Language is the practice of using long and complex strings of noises and marks to successfully adapt to one’s environment. If language is at all a break in the continuity between other species and humans, it is only insofar as it is a tool that humans have at their disposal, which amoebas, squirrels, and the like do not. Nevertheless, just as other species have developed the tools of night-hunting, migration and hibernation to adapt to environmental change, we have used language as a tool for our survival. Thus, for Rorty, language is not a mysterious add-on over and above human creaturehood, but part of our “animality,” as he puts it. As a conveyer of meaning, language should be understood as the use of sentences to achieve a practical goal through a cooperative effort. It is “the ability to have and ascribe sentential attitudes” that contributes to our species’ successful survival in a world of dynamic possibilities. In this way, borrowing from Darwin, Rorty naturalizes language.

Darwin also has made materialism respectable to an educated public once, according to Rorty (Truth and Progress, 1998), his “vitalism” is dismissed. Darwin’s detailed account of the way in which both life and consciousness might have evolved from non-living, non-conscious chemical soup gave plausibility to their emergence free from teleology. Taking the new-found respectability of materialism along with the recognition of the human species’ full-fledged animality, the search for a non-natural cause for the prolific display of life on earth can be dispensed with as misguided. So too can a hunt for a non-human purpose for human life. “After Darwin,” Rorty asserts, “it became possible to believe that nature is not leading up to anything—that nature has nothing in mind.”

Without transcendent standards or intrinsic ends to aspire to, we humans find ourselves radically free to invent the purpose of human life and the means to achieve it. Rorty, well aware of the need for a consistent anti-representationalist narrative, acknowledges that even Darwin’s theory of evolutionary change is just one more image of the way things “are,” one no more privileged than any other coherent narrative in representing reality in-itself—an impossible task. In fact Rorty suggests that the main, albeit unintended, contribution of Darwin is the de-mythologizing of the human self (considered as part of an unnarrated, objective reality). Rorty argues that we should “read Darwin not as offering one more theory about what we really are but as providing reasons why we do not need to ask what we really are.” Old habits of deferentially attributing to an immaterial spirit or to nature’s intrinsic life-force (for example, élan vital) the power to determine the structure, meaning of, and means to our existence ought to be set aside as outmoded and replaced by a story of dynamic cultural innovation and humanistic pluralism. This is the pragmatic vocabulary that Rorty envisions Darwin preparing with his notion of evolutionary change, a vocabulary that is further molded by the writings of Martin Heidegger.

c. Heidegger: Contingency over Certainty

Martin Heidegger influenced Rorty in the direction of process over permanence. Labeling the history of Western metaphysics “the ontotheological tradition,” Heidegger postulated that an underlying assumption persisted from Plato down to the positivists: the power relation of “the stronger overcoming the weaker.” Rorty (in “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” 1991) notes that Heidegger finds that thinkers as diverse as Aristotle, St. Paul, Descartes, and Hegel assume this sort of asymmetrical power relation in the process of searching for the truth that overcomes ignorance, tames sensual desire by reason, or defeats sin with the aid of God’s grace. Each thinker in his own fashion seeks a force that overwhelms the subject as it makes its project evident. By doing so, the individual ceases to create and live his own projects in deference to the presence of the stronger influence. The submission to this influence would be both a concession to a power greater than oneself and identification with it. And it is in this identification, Heidegger claimed, that a subtle shift from an attitude of subservience to one of control and domination occurs within the seeker.

Rorty agrees with Heidegger that the “quest for certainty, clarity, and direction from outside can also be viewed as an attempt to escape from time, to view Sein as something that has little to do with Zeit.” For the ontotheological tradition, time, in its fleeting manifestations, receives the unfavorable comparison with the reality of the eternal. Thus the unspoken goal of the metaphysically-inclined advocates of this philosophical tradition is to be free from the contingency, the uncertainty, and the fragility of the human condition by a release into and identification with the eternal. Valuing power above fragility, propositions over words, truth to metaphor, philosophy above poetry, in the hands of pre-Heideggerian philosophers the use of language becomes merely a means in the pursuit of a reality and a force which rises above the signifier.

Heidegger rejected this family of philosophical thinking along with its “quest for disinterested theoretical truth” as an over-intellectualized escape from the human condition. It is at its core inauthentic. The will to truth of the metaphysician is actually the poetic urge in disguise. Since antiquity, the ontotheological tradition is the attempt by (poetic) thinkers to deploy a series of metaphors to break away from the contingency of poetic metaphor. More than hypocritical, in Heidegger eyes, the ontotheologian exhibits hubris in his belief that Western philosophy is capable of getting it right and be clear about what is real, rather than appreciating his attempt as just one of many practices trying to give voice to the “reality” of Being. Instead Heidegger urged that an amalgamation of beliefs and desires had to be made in order to recover and reassert the “force of words” heard as when they were first spoken—original and potent—in order to open a space for Being.

Rorty understands Heidegger to be saying that there are just we humans and the power of the words we happen to speak. There is no designer, no controller, and no choreographer of human projects, only ourselves and the languages we create. “We are nothing save the words we use.” Thus the poet, in dealing forthrightly with the contingency and historicity of words is an authentic coiner of metaphor. And metaphor is what discloses Being, just as Being is formed and manifested in metaphor. As Rorty writes in “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” “As long as an understanding of Being is ontically possible ‘is there’ Being.”

The use of the term “Being” by Heidegger is, for Rorty, somewhat problematic. With Heidegger, Rorty agrees that there is no hidden power called Being. Rorty interprets Heidegger’s Being as what “final vocabularies” are about. When he declares that “Being’s poem is the poem of Being,” Rorty is not claiming that there is a work of reality that Being “writes”; rather he means that there is no meta-vocabulary to distinguish the adequacy of one final vocabulary above others. Nor is there any non-linguistic, pre-cognitive access to an already present Being that underscores some narrative as preferred. There is no way to escape the contingencies of language to get at Being-in-itself. We are all enmeshed in final vocabularies that present Being in diverse and incommensurate ways. No understanding of Being is better than any other understanding. Heidegger thus cleared the way for Rorty’s dismissal of the realism-antirealism debate and his gloss of Western tradition as the development of pragmatic practices designed to cope with contemporary conditions while remaining open to future descriptions.

Nevertheless, for Heidegger the evolving pattern of power relations that has been the history of Western metaphysics culminates in the “technical,” pragmatic interpretation of thinking. Rorty obviously must differ with Heidegger in the latter’s rejection of pragmatism as the concluding, and unfortunate, outcome of the ontotheological tradition. In “Heidegger, Contingency, and Pragmatism,” Rorty suggests that if Heidegger had only to choose between pragmatism and Platonism, pragmatism would be his choice, fully aware of Heidegger’s distain for pragmatism and his offering of a third option: authentic Dasein’s primal understanding of Being. Yet Rorty maintains that he opts for the early Heidegger’s construal of the “analytic of Dasein” as an interpretation of the Western world-view rather than the later Heidegger’s reading of it as “an account of the ahistorical conditions for the occurrence of history.” In doing so Rorty dismisses all suggestions by Heidegger that some historically embedded language-users’ understanding of Being (for example, the ancient Greeks’) can be more open to (less forgetful of) Being than any subsequent appreciation due to their status as “primordial” inventors of the Western tradition’s metaphors. Yet Rorty also insists that it is impossible to rank understandings because no descriptive account can better help us get behind that which is poetically construed. There is no validating reality behind our narrative; Being and interpretive narrative arise together. Therefore, Rorty appropriates for pragmatism only Heidegger’s sense of contingency and the transitory condition of human life, along with the ability to radically redescribe Western culture. He sets aside Heidegger’s nostalgia for an authentic world-view that says something neutral about the structure of all present and possible world-views. By doing so, Rorty aligns himself more with John Dewey’s brand of anti-essentialism and anti-foundationalism than with Heidegger’s project. For Dewey’s vision of a democratic utopia includes “technical,” pragmatic thinking that is put in service to social practice for the purpose of achieving the integration of inquiry and poetry, theory and practice.

d. Dewey’s Pragmatic Democracy

As with Hegel and Darwin, Rorty intentionally “misreads” or “redescribes” John Dewey from a late-Twentieth-century pragmatist’s perspective. This “hypothetical Dewey” is shorn of what Rorty considers to be dead metaphors in the former’s philosophy (that is his “scientistic” empirical rhetoric and panpsychic notion of experience). Conversely for Rorty, a continuing live option in Dewey’s thought is his naturalism and pragmatism. Seen in this light, Rorty’s Dewey becomes the synthesis of historicism and the expediency of evolutionary adaptation. Most notably, Dewey manifested this fusion in his rejection of the “crust of convention” born of a tradition that took language as representational of reality rather than as instrumental in satisfying a society’s shared beliefs and hopes. The fading conviction originating with Plato that language can adequately represent what there is in words opens the way for a pragmatic utilization of language as a means to address current needs through practical deliberations among thoughtful people.

This view of language is critical for Rorty. With the shift in attitude away from the expectation, on one hand, that through narrative a revelation of moral perfection may become manifest, or, on the other, that through the clear and methodical use of language epistemic certainty may be achieved, humanity is freed to view morality and science as being evolving processes, where means lead to ends and those ends in turn become means toward future aims. Rorty characterizes this, Dewey’s means-ends continuum, as the claim that we change our ideas of what is true, right and good on the basis of the particular blend of success and failure produced by our prior labors to fulfill our hopes. Rorty writes that philosophers such as Dewey “have kept alive the historicist sense that this century’s ‘superstition’ was the last century’s triumph of reason and the relativist sense that the latest vocabulary, borrowed from the latest scientific achievement, may not express privileged representations of essences, but be just another of the potential infinity of vocabularies in which the world can be described.”

In rejecting representationalism and the essentialism that it implies, Dewey abandons the Cartesian-inspired spectator account of knowledge, which radically separates the knowing subject from the object being studied. No longer considering that objectivity a result of a detachment from the material under study but rather as an ongoing interaction with that which is at hand, Dewey elevates practice over theory; better said, he puts theory in service to practice. From Rorty’s perspective, while Dewey had a great insight, he ought to have taken the next step and rejected scientism—the claim that scientific method allows humanity to gain a privileged insight into the structural processes of nature. His failure to reject the alleged epistemologically privileged stance is one main reason Rorty must re-imagine Dewey. Nevertheless, Dewey’s elevation of practice continues the movement away from the pre-Darwinian attachment to the belief in a non-human source of purpose and the immutability of natural kinds toward a contingent “world,” where humans define and redefine their social and material environments. It is within a social practice or a “language-game” that specific marks and sounds come to designate commonly accepted meanings. And, as Rorty states in “Feminism and Pragmatism,” (1995) no set of marks or sounds (memes) can ever bring cognitive clarity about the way the world is or the way we as humans are. Instead, memes compete with one another in an evolutionary struggle over cultural space, just as genes compete for survival in the natural environment. Unguided by an immanent or transcendent teleology, the memes’ replication is determined by their usefulness within a given social group. And it is through their utility for the continued existence and prospering of a social group that the group’s memes—like their genes—are carried forward and flourish. They establish their niche in the socio-ecological system.

By the linkage of meme selection with Darwinian natural selection, Rorty can reasonably say that “the history of social practices is continuous with the history of biological evolution.” He adds a crucial caveat: memes gradually usurp the role of genes. Thus the driving force in human existence becomes the socio-linguistic. And as in the process of natural selection there is no social practice that is privileged and final; no one cultural “species” is intrinsically favored over another. It follows that, as Dewey has said “The worse or evil is a rejected good.” Before deliberation and choice there can be no intrinsic good, no God’s-Eye clarity as to what the true, the right and the just are. All options are competing goods. It is only with the triumph of one set of memes over another by means of manipulation, coercion or force that the determination of a society’s memes as the good (or the bad) of the situation can be asserted. Rorty recognizes that the Deweyan approach, which denies that knowledge is the stable grasping of an independent reality and which asserts “reality” to be a term of value, may lead to the charge of relativism and power-worship. But he believes that the benefits for a democratic society where there is an unfettered competition of ideas outweigh the downside of his anti-universalist stance. Therefore, given the historicist belief that there is no viable alternative to being immersed within the contemporary understanding of one’s time, place and culture, then to abandon the memes with which one chooses to be identified—together with the solidarity one has formed with like-minded others around those memes—would be an absurd denial of one’s self and one’s beliefs. (This is the basis of Rorty’s ethnocentricism.)

Rorty wishes to promote consciously a democracy of plurality and hope rather than one where either private autonomy or communal solidarity dominates. This sentiment can be found most clearly beginning with Contingency, Irony and Solidarity (1989), culminating in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999). By developing an evolutionary sense of history through Dewey’s writings Rorty associates a generalized Darwinism directly with democracy. Growth, or the flourishing of ideas in a political environment that is conducive to the flowering of ideas and practices, is the hope for the future. While there is no metaphysical grounding of this hope in the essence of humanity or in the structure of the world, Rorty maintains that a future where we may continue to be astounded by the latest creative endeavors is a future where human happiness has the best chance.

This democratic trope is acceptable to Rorty because he agrees with Dewey that the essentialist-foundationalist worldview was a product of Europe’s inegalitarian past. The conservative, leisure-class’s desire to maintain the status quo was incorporated into a philosophy that favored eternal necessities over the temporal contingencies and the uncovering of static natures over the engagement with the dynamic processes. As such it stood in the way of growth and constructive change. By shifting attention away from traditional memes to those that focuses on the future, Dewey meant to reconstruct philosophy into the exercise of practical judgment, a dedication to the kinds of understanding that are geared to contemporary obstacles that obstruct the flow of expressive creativity. Rorty endorses Dewey’s intention.

As Rorty characterizes Dewey’s vision, Pragmatism would, for the first time, “put the intellectuals at the service of the productive class rather than the leisure class.” Theory is to be treated as an aid to practice, rather than practice being seen as defective theory. With the assent of practice, the distinctions characteristic of dualism, those between mind and matter, thought and action, and appearance and reality, blur and fall away. Following precisely on this notion is political egalitarianism. If there is not to be dualistic distinction in the abstract, then none should be manifested in practice. Rorty accepts that individual self-reliance ought to be exercised on a communal level. Dewey promotes philosophy as the art of the politically useful. His is a social democracy where the policies that bring social utility are the policies that are best. This is where theoretical creativity ties into Rortyan pragmatic hope: “that one should stop worrying about whether what one believes is well-grounded and start worrying about whether one has been imaginative enough to think up interesting alternatives to one’s present beliefs.” Rorty holds that this is uniquely possible for all citizens in a democratic environment, where the clash of memes can happen under an auspicious tolerance that suppresses to a minimum pain and humiliation and allow for a flourishing of diversity. This is where pragmatism fuses with utilitarian values. Rorty suggests that it is reasonable to offer persuasive rhetoric rather than the use of physical assault or its preludes of mockery and insult, because coming to terms with people will likely increase human happiness in the long run. That is, by keeping open the lines of communication, new and exciting projects for the betterment of our condition has the best chance to develop than if fear and intimidation are the norm. It is the establishment of conditions conducive for human happiness that is the utopian hope within the human heart.

e. Davidson on Truth and Meaning

Rorty had claimed (prior to Ramberg’s essay—see section 5b below) that there was no more of a gap between human psychology and biology than between biology and chemistry (“McDowell, Davidson, and Spontaneity”, 1998). This follows easily from his Deweyan take on Darwinism. Once we accept Dewey’s pragmatism, then the vocabularies that allegedly could distinguish between the human and the natural come under serious challenge. Different disciplines are founded to achieve different purposes. There is no way for a discipline to try to be more “adequate to the world” than any other when, with Rorty, one gives up on, say, Quine’s physicalism which ranks some vocabulary (physics) as ontologically superior to others. If we generalize this rejection, as Rorty does, then one is able to reject scientism, a position which holds that a descriptive practice’s success or failure depends on its capture of a determinative material reality. Once we abandon the idea that one vocabulary is best suited to express the intrinsic order of things, then the ability to express the truth through the use of one vocabulary but not another is due to the different focus of interest that each vocabulary has, and not because one excels beyond all others in the expression of facts. There is a flat, deontologized, playing field among different descriptive strategies. These strategies are tools in the pragmatist’s toolbox to be utilized under appropriate conditions of need-fulfillment. So, for instance, if psychology is rightly conceived as a different practice than, say, economics, it is a practice that is geared to achieve a particular outcome deemed as important by the discipline of psychology, but not necessarily to economics, or for that matter, physics, ethics, and so forth. Psychology is merely a different causal strategy which an individual may choose to engage “nature” to achieve a specific outcome. But no strategy can claim to have the unique language-strategy that gets things right. Rorty believes there is no “super-language” that achieves a more adequate description of our relation to something other than ourselves because all vocabularies merely describe our practices as we engage in a causal interaction with “reality” as understood through those practices.

This position is available to Rorty largely due to Donald Davidson’s argument against the content-scheme distinction. This distinction, common in all dualisms, is seen as necessary only when credence is given to there being disparate ontological realms—one containing beliefs, the other containing non-beliefs (for example, matters of fact). Truth then becomes the correct analysis of the non-causal relation between particular beliefs and specific non-beliefs. But Davidson argues that such a dichotomy lacks credibility. That there is a mysterious relation between human and the non-human which tertia such as “experience,” “sensory stimulation,” “the world,” and so forth, act as epistemological bridges is, according to Davidson, an illusion created by the endeavor to take language as a medium or an instrument used to define truth. Rorty explains that Davidson avoids this representationalist pitfall by understanding “true” in terms of one’s own linguistic know-how. The “language I know,” the way that one’s community copes with the environment in practice, is enough to erase the alleged schism between intentional objects (the objects that most of the rules of action of one’s—or some other—linguistic community are true of; that is, are good for dealing with) and their referents. This is Davidson’s “Principle of Charity.”

The central understanding that Rorty draws from Davidson’s notion of “radical translation” at the heart of the “Principle of Charity” is that we language-users have already the causal link established between our beliefs and their referent(s). There is no need to establish a connection, it is the human condition. This linkage allows us to get things for the most part correct and thus make most of our statements about the world true, and to recognize that any translation is a faulty translation which renders as wrong most of a speaker’s beliefs about the world. Rorty suggests that it follows that any wholesale gap between intentional objects and referents would be impossible since survival depended upon humanity’s pragmatic application of beliefs to the environment. This carries over to our own individual webs of belief. Most of anyone’s beliefs must be, on the whole, true. Rorty uses this insight to explain that though we cannot get outside our beliefs and our language to establish some test besides the coherence of our own or others’ webs of belief we can still speak objectively and have knowledge of a public world not of our personal design.

It is through a Davidsonian holistic view of language that Rorty, contra Davidson, takes “truth” as a misguided slide back into representationalism. For Davidson, truth is a transparent term that in itself does not explain anything but emerges when the rules for action causally interact successfully with the world. Rorty rejects all appeals to truth, Davidsonian or otherwise, in favor of social justification. Because there are no comprehensive barriers between oneself and the world, we are free to advance beliefs with the aim of persuading others as to their efficacy in obtaining the outcomes they most desire. This is how Rorty blends Davidson’s notion of radical translation with Dewey’s naturalism to yield Rorty’s neopragmatism.

4. Positions

a. Overview

The overarching theme of Rorty’s writing is a promotion of a thorough-going naturalism. Recognizing the value of the Enlightenment challenge to religious speculation, and its offering of a humanist philosophy in its place, Rorty argues that the Enlightenment program was never completed. It fell short of its goal by keeping one foot in the past. By substituting the notion of Truth as One in place of a monotheistic worldview, the Enlightenment reformers repeated the tradition’s error by continuing to seek non-human authority, now in the guise of what Wilfrid Sellers called “the Myth of the Given.” Holding that reality has an intrinsic nature, and by advancing the correspondence theory of truth, Enlightenment philosophers turned away from full-blown naturalism, ironically, in service to a scientific objectivity that required a radical separation of the observer from the observed. Rorty’s neopragmatism is meant to ameliorate this perceived shortcoming by rigorously following through on Immanuel Kant’s distinction between causality and justification.

Rorty holds that our relation with the environment is purely causal. However, the way in which we describe it—the linguistic tools we employ to cope with the recalcitrance of that environment in an effort to achieve our purposes and desires, as natural creatures in the natural world—determines how we understand that world. Once we are causally prompted to form a belief, justification may take place in a social world where, as Davidson notes, only a belief can justify a belief. In short, Rorty maintains that there can be no norms derived from the natural, but only from the social.

This position allows Rorty to reject scientism (the representationalist view that cleaves to the Myth of the Given) while endorsing the development of a fully-naturalized science as an extremely useful tool for prediction and control. It also opens the way for Rorty to advance naturalized democracy with confidence. Instead of seeking some underlying fact about human nature which is essential, ahistorical, and universalizable, Rorty proposes we seek the justifications that are relevant to a contextually embedded practice. The loss of the unconditionality associated with long-established notions of truth is actually a gain, pragmatically speaking. While truth is an aim that is unachievable due to its definitional ambivalence prior to commitment to action, justification is a recognizable (and contingent) goal that permits practical satisfaction without closing the door on future recalibrations in response to inevitable challenges to such justifications. The best way to allow for justification of a belief with no neutral standpoint, Rorty suggests, is to allow competing beliefs to be evaluated on their performance capabilities and not on their ability to ground themselves in universal validity. This leads directly to Rorty’s ethnocentricism.

The following are various positions Rorty takes in accordance with his project of New Pragmatism.

b. Philosophy: Neither Realism nor Antirealism

For Rorty one of the results of the merging of Dewey’s naturalism with Davidson’s view of truth is the dropping of the realist-anti-realist issue. One is always in touch with reality as a language user, thus the distinction between truth-conditions and assertibility-conditions dissolves. However, it is important to note that although we humans use language to engage the environment it does not make the process artificial, in the sense of language concealing a transcendent reality behind social constructs, or by its being in wholesale error concerning the inherent character of the natural world. Rorty writes in Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth (1991) that “Davidson, on my interpretation, thinks that the benefit of going ‘linguistic’ is that getting rid of the Cartesian mind is the first step toward eliminating the tertia which, by seeming to intrude between us and the world, created the old metaphysical issues in the first place.” He continues that once we dispense with the tertia that try to breach the now discredited scheme-content gap, the distinction between appearance (“useful fictions”) and reality (“objective facts”) disappears. What remain are one’s community practices unfolding in a seamless and endless process of reweaving webs of beliefs in response to current and future conditions. From his rejection of the realist-anti-realist distinction springs Rorty’s anti-essentialist nominalism and anti-foundationalism.

c. Anti-essential Nominalism

Related to Rorty’s rejection of what he characterizes as the false dichotomy between realism and antirealism, is his dismissal of all ideas of essentialism. The Neurath’s Boat thought experiment poses no problem for Rorty. Terms like “boat” or “self” are strictly linguistic in nature. That is, they do not refer to Platonic Forms or Aristotelian essences, but to linguistically constructed, intentional objects. Boats or selves may undergo complete change piece-by-piece and still maintain their identity if and only if there is social agreement about the continuance of such notions. What is radical in Rorty’s linguistic principle is that there is no ultimate difference between the human and the non-human “entities;” they are definable and redefinable “all the way down.” There is nothing standing under [sub-stance] or above to anchor the ever-evolving linguistic parsing of metaphors.

Similarly, reference to reflexive consciousness, the hallmark of unique and private Cartesian self distinct from all non-conscious objects is, for Rorty an illegitimate attempt to nest metaphysical assertions about the existence of a separate human mind in the epistemology of first-person, self-evident awareness. Equally illegitimate is the appeal to materialism common to scientism. Language that reduces consciousness to brain functions creates a vocabulary that attempts to explain mental events as happenings of material alteration. There is a metaphysical assumption in materialism that Rorty, as an anti-essentialist, cannot countenance: that there is a physical world that is “really there” adequate to the cause of the mental.

Neither a reductive materialist nor dualistic subjectivist, Rorty opts for nominalist-pragmatism. That materialists deal with reality is to be understood as their concentrating on the concepts and descriptors they find most useful to discuss. When dualists maintain that there is an awareness which stands distinct from that which is extended and non-conscious, it shows their stubborn commitment to the dead Cartesian metaphor. Descartes’ reconstruction of the world was designed to secure the study of physics in a religious environment hostile to its practice. To reify Descartes’ “mind as a mental eye” metaphor as that which “perceives” itself as a self-evident “given” is to misunderstand the application of language to personal experience. This is a major theme of Rorty’s Philosophy as the Mirror of Nature (1979), as captured in his “Antipodean Analogy.” It is a challenge and reminder to the reader that the way we speak about the mental can (and will at some future time) be radically reconceived. If there can be found nothing essential to the mental that extends beyond and grounds our description of it, the very process with which we seem most intimate, then it follows that there is nothing essential—non-linguistic—to the non-mental either. There is no essential constitution to our minds. Rorty declares that privacy, immediacy, introspectibility, intentionality, incorrigibility, and self-evidency can be redescribed in terms that do not involve subjectivism (see also “Dennett on Awareness”).

d. Anti-foundationalist Historicism

Rorty denies the utility of all foundational philosophies (for example, Cartesian clear and distinct ideas, Kantian a priori truths, and so forth) on the basis that they share with representationalism a belief that the mind is the “mirror of nature.” Once the metaphysical distinction between appearance and reality disappears, so too ought the need for a knowing subject with a special faculty for apodictic truth. Seen by Rorty as secular theories meant to identify the necessary grounding of knowledge previously provided by the Divine or natural order, foundationalisms of all stripes have in common the desire for the subject to escape temporality and contingency into a transcendent viewpoint capable of experiencing the power of truth (for example, “truth resists attempts to refute it”), pressing rational minds toward consensus. Thus, in Rorty’s opinion, the invention of the transcendent subject is an attempt to salvage epistemologically a relation to a metaphysical realm that has been abandoned by post-Kantian thinkers. He holds that foundationalists arbitrarily raise to the level of universal the mundane linguistic practices and social norms that have dominated minds at some moment and in some locale. Rorty rejects the cultural hegemony implied in foundationalist narratives, and by doing so asserts a historicist belief in the inescapable embeddedness of the human condition in the flux and flow of evolutionary change. There is, from his perspective, no neutral, ahistorical standpoint, no “God’s-eye viewpoint” from which to gain a Parmenidean perspective on what there is. What we can assent to is a plurality of standpoints that achieve social acceptance because of their utility in and for the here and now.

e. Ethnocentricism

A natural order of reason is one more “relic” of the idea that truth consists of correspondence to the intrinsic nature of things. Absent an ahistorical standpoint from which to judge the intrinsic nature of reality, there is no such thing as a proposition that is justified without qualification or an argument which will better approximate the truth per se. For Rorty, there is no natural context-independent reason which somehow heralds and underlies all descriptive vocabulary. He considers the idea of context-independent truth a misguided effort to hypostatize the adjective “true” by repackaging it in epistemological terms of the Platonic attempt to hypostatize the adjective ‘good.’ Only such hypostatization causes one to believe that there is a goal of inquiry beyond justification to relevant contemporary audiences. Rorty holds: “All reasons are reasons for a particular people, restrained by spatial, temporal, and social conditions.” When we have justified our beliefs to an audience considered pertinent, we need not make any further claims, universal or otherwise.

To insist on context-independence would be to endow reason with causal powers that enable a particular descriptive vocabulary to resist refutation regardless of time, place, and social conditions. Alternately, one could suppose an ideal audience with the ability to speak a privileged vocabulary that allows its speakers to escape human limits and achieve a God-like grasp of the totality of possibility. But Rorty insists that there is neither such an audience, nor a privileged vocabulary that provides a priori a language of justification with the potential to draw all mundane audiences into universal consensus. There are only diverse linguistic communities, each of which has its own final vocabulary and its shared context-embedded perspective on reality, a reality that is forever and already interpreted from that standpoint.

Since, from the Rortyan outlook, the reality-appearance distinction is a relic of our authoritarian ontotheological tradition—the transmutation of the extrinsic, non-human power (that must be submitted to) into the secularized intrinsic nature of reality that still carries with it all the authoritarian drawbacks inherent in the tradition’s outdated metaphor (for example, Habermasian “universal validity”)—then the secularized metaphor of power/submission ought to be discarded along with the remnants of its religious origin.

But Rorty does not want to throw out entirely the fruits of Western culture. To the contrary, he says that he is “lucky” to having been raised within this cultural tradition, especially because of its tendencies for critical analysis and tolerance. In this vein, Rorty responds to a Habermasian critique: “I regard it a fortunate historical accident that we find ourselves in a culture . . . which is highly sensitized to the need to go beyond (dogmatic borders of thought).” Nevertheless, he does not hold that his luck is any different from that felt by Germans who considered themselves fortunate to enroll in the Hitler Youth. It’s simply a chance matter as to which society one is born, and what set of beliefs is valued therein.

Carrying forward his naturalistic, Darwinian views, Rorty sees humans as creatures whose beliefs and desires are for the most part formed by a process of acculturation. With no non-relative criteria or standards for telling real justifications from merely apparent ones, it follows that there can be no teleological mechanism independent of specific social narratives to determine the socioethical superiority of one solidarity over another. Since we all acquire our moral identity and obligations from our native culture (the niche in which we find ourselves), why not embrace our own social virtues as valid and try to redefine the world in terms of them? This is Rorty’s argument for ethnocentricism; a position from which one “can give the notion such as ‘moral obligation’ a respectable, secular, non-transcendental sense by relativizing it to a historically contingent sense of moral identity.” And if this is a form of cultural relativism, so be it. Rorty does not fear relativism, since fear grows from the concern that there is nothing in the universe to hang onto except ourselves. This is his humanist point against the claim that reason transcends local opinion; there is only ourselves nested in the habits of action evolving over time into the current, contingent societal solidarities we find useful for achieving our purposes.

f. Philosophy as Metaphor

In line with Rorty’s nominalism is his idea of philosophy as metaphor. Once one abandons the search for truth and for a reality that is concealed behind the everyday world, the role of a social practice in the vanguard of cultural change and innovation (philosophical or otherwise) is, or ought to be, to liberate humanity from old metaphors that are rooted in superstition, mystification, and a religion-inspired mindset. He suggests that this can be done by offering new metaphors and reshaping vocabularies that will accommodate new, “abnormal” insights. In this function, philosophy will note the fears kindled by past practices as well as the hopes springing from the present, and reconcile them by avoiding ancient fallacies while projecting contemporary justified beliefs into the future. Key to this project is the acknowledgement that philosophical theories have tended to reify that which had been proposed in the past as useful metaphors. This cognitive “idolatry” is an outgrowth of the adoption of the correspondence theory of knowledge. Beginning with Plato’s use of perception to analogize the relation of the psyche to the Forms, philosophers have mistakenly tried to make a word-world connection in order to ground reality in thought. The trouble with this approach is that it causes one to look behind the vocabulary for a non-human entity or force which grounds its meaning in our consciousness. Rorty thinks that this representational scheme is wrongheaded because it confuses use for content. He holds that it is rather in the use of words that we come to grips with our ever-changing environment. Successful adaptation of metaphors to new conditions is more likely when one drops the expectation that words are made adequate by that environment, or a creative agency of that environment. It is left to humans to consciously fashion their own metaphors to cope with the world. Freed from the tyranny of locating and adopting a non-human vocabulary, human ingenuity and creativity will craft undreamt of possibilities as surely as Galileo reinvented our understanding of the “heavens” by jettisoning of the outmoded Aristotelian crystalline celestial metaphor, or as Thomas Kuhn reinvented our understanding of paradigms by recasting the Kantian idiom.

g. Anti-representational Metaphilosophy

Rorty’s anti-representationalism is closely associated with his anti-essential nominalism. While Rorty does not doubt that there is a reality that is recalcitrant to some (but not all) linguistic approaches (that is to say that not all attempts at constructing language-games prove useful to our local purposes work), he rejects that there can ever be a narrative that has a privileged viewpoint and/or has the final determination on “What there is.” Traditional Western Philosophy’s establishment of, alternately, rationalist, empiricist or transcendental worldviews to address the problem of depicting in words and ideas what is, in fact, does not so much outline a pattern of progress in expressing more adequate illustrations of reality; rather, it presents a history of the “idea idea” which Rorty holds as a red herring. Since the time of Plato, struggles over first principles have yielded academic debates that are seemingly endless attempts to characterize the world, but that are counterproductive to conversations aimed at changing the world. Rorty suggests that philosophers change the subject. Subject-changing is possible because there can be no common framework in which all minds participate. The possibility of different language-games offers a multitude of frameworks from which to choose, given Rorty’s anti-representational stance. No framework is more or less part of the fabric of the universe. Rather, dialogue ought to supersede certainty; interpretation to trump the search for truth. First-order philosophical search for a stable, final vocabulary that coherently captures the world in words or accurately corresponds to it drops out and is replaced with narrative-driven conversation. The plurality of interpretations that follows opens the way for an ever-evolving exchange concerning the function of proposed statements relative to a context; a series of pragmatic dialogues about what course of action is best fitted to a contemporary situation.

A special case stands out for Rorty’s anti-representationalist critique, that of scientism. Since the Enlightenment, objectivity via method has been the standard for scientific investigators. The systematic reading of the material world by those who are expert in the vocabulary of the sciences (that is, the quantification of observation statements) privileges these “rational” interpretations over all others. The assumption is that the universe is at its core a unified complex readily available for accurate and thorough analysis once one assumes the proper epistemological stance. And once taken that stance will build upon itself in an ever-increasing accumulation of objective knowledge. This optimistic progressivism is questioned by Rorty. Following Dewey’s dismissal of the dispassionate, autonomous knower of culturally neutral, objective knowledge, Rorty criticizes scientism’s image of the givenness of the world and the ability of scientists to discover the rational structures inherent in it. Viewing knowledge as an historical and cultural artifact, Rorty wishes to replace scientism’s systematic worldview with an “edifying” philosophy that treats science as just one among many non-privileged approaches, each of which projects sets of rules designed to bring about the well-being of a community. The choice of which of these approaches is most beneficial is the topic of the open-ended, interdisciplinary conversation favored by Rorty. Being free from teleological constraint, this sort of dialogue carries with it the expectation that convergent consensus is never possible; thus science cannot be the focal point of, or unique conduit for, an ever improving meeting of minds. Instead, Rorty considers all consensuses as contingent, partial, and on-going solidarities directed toward some specific practical outcome.

h. Pragmatic Pluralism

With no neutral ground from which to establish convergent consensus, all positions are competing ideas; presumed goods struggling for their existence. Thus, each is a live option until the practice is accepted by, or it is abandoned as non-workable for, a society. Appeals beyond the social environment have been eliminated by Rorty’s anti-foundational and anti-essential stances. Without a vocabulary that captures either the way the world is or a core human nature, there is never any possibility to locate a metaphysical foundation for truth. Equally unrealizable is a distinct epistemological platform from which to resolve differences between incongruent intuitions. Without transcendent or transpersonal standards, Liberal and Conservative narratives, atheist and fundamentalist ideologies, and realist and pragmatist approaches all vie equally for a cultural niche determining what works for a group at a given time. With everything unanchored and in flux, there is never a settled outcome, no final vocabulary that prevents the emergence of novel practices that threaten to eclipse the established ways of life. A plurality of metaphors thrives and in doing so upsets the settled, the canonical, the convergent consensus, keeping the conversation going. Rorty contends that it is the bruising competition among rival frameworks, including his own, that will result in a shakeout of the best framework fit for the times, around which will form a solidarity (albeit, contingently) of similarly-minded individuals. And the bounty of ideas, project, and programs will be surprisingly novel and astoundingly different.

i. Solidarities, Poets, and the Jeffersonian Strategy

The idea of a convergent consensus is built around the expectation that there is a grounding metaphysical standard “beyond” the flux of time, culture and circumstance, and that this standard has been the object of search for millennia. But to locate this standard, the seekers already must be at the consensus point which is being sought; they must already know what this is in order to find the real. Rorty considers this sort of Platonist reminiscence to be a vicious circle that assumes the consequent, i.e., that an objective point of view, in fact, exists. Even the Kantian attempt to circumvent this problem by asserting that we can have a priori knowledge of objects that we constitute ignores the troubling fact, according to Rorty, that Kant never explained how we have apodictic knowledge of the “constituting activities” of a transcendental ego. This attempt at self-foundation founders in another, more threatening way. In the placing of the “outer” into the “inner, constituting space,” the rational mind (seen as Reason itself) becomes the arbiter of cultural norms (“culture” being conceived as a collection of knowledge claims). Thus the discipline of philosophy becomes the keeper of the status quo, whose opinions and mode of thinking becomes the one true standard for any other discipline to measure itself against. However, Rorty emphatically denies that Philosophy as a discipline holds this crucial role. In fact, he argues that we should put aside the Kantian distinctions between disciplines as inegalitarian, and favor an open-mindedness based upon the Jeffersonian model of religious tolerance.

This Jeffersonian strategy, in line with Rorty’s historicist anti-foundationalism and anti-essentialist nominalism, is designed to encourage the abandonment of any claim of the discovery of an all-encompassing system of thought that serves as the legitimizer of all other practices. Seen as a remnant of the onto-theological period in human thinking, systematic philosophy suffers the same ills as traditional dogmatic theologies in that they both project as universal historically embedded, cultural values. The remedy that Rorty wishes to apply to this systematizing is to split public practices from private beliefs, treating all theories as narratives on par with each other, and to shelter edifying impulses toward poetic self-creativity from all pressures to conform. This dual strategy levels the playing field in the public sector, allowing unrestricted democratic dialogue between groups holding rival narratives (solidarities), while at the same time liberating creative thought from the normalizing restraints of the alleged privileged rationality asserted by Theological, Philosophical or Scientific solidarities. What is denied in Rorty’s Jeffersonian strategy is any universal commensuration in either the epistemological or metaphysical sphere, as well as the privilege of the rational in a supposed hierarchical system of reality. What is gained is the possibility for the expression of alternative, “abnormal” voices in the conversation of humankind, which, in potential, may prove to be persuasive enough to draw a growing number of adherents into its ranks, thereby creating a new solidarity better adapted to the contemporary environment, with its unique set of issues and requirements than are prior narratives. The evolution of unique narratives is progressive in the sense that each society and every era can discard encrusted customs and embrace novel practices that seem best in addressing the problems at hand. It is also contingent because there can be no final vocabulary that gets it right about human nature or the nature of existence. All is in play “all the way down” in an essence-less world where any foundational pretence to a harmony between the human subject and the objects of knowledge is eschewed, and where justification is confined to “beliefs that cannot swing free from the nonhuman environment.”

j. Non-reductive Materialism and the Self

Rorty sees the division between reductive materialism and subjectivism as a pseudo-problem originating with the Cartesian mind-body dualism. These incommensurate descriptions both pose as the sole truth on the subject of the nature of ontologically real objects. Wishing to “dedivinize” philosophy, science and discussions on the self, Rorty occasionally concentrates on the last of this troika in an effort to unsettle the western notion about an underlying substantial metaphysical center grounding existence. In his “Contingency of Selfhood,” Rorty defends contingencies and discontinuities of the “I” against realist thought. It is plausible that most Enlightenment thinkers could not fathom how inert matter and its motion could account for the first person experience of human consciousness. Rorty suggests that fear against the association of selfhood to the dying human animal may be a motivation for philosophers since Plato to posit a central essence for individuals. To this concern Rorty resorts to non-reductive materialism to explain away the mind-body issue that has concerned thoughtful people for the last four hundred years.

The use of descriptive vocabularies plays an important part in Rorty’s gloss on the human “self.” In his narrative, one vocabulary is centered on the description of physical objects and another is concerned with the discursive agent. The discursive agent may redescribe all objects, including him/herself, as subject in ever more “abnormal” terms without limits. Nevertheless, once a description is dedicated to a physicalist’s accounts of brain activity, it becomes incumbent upon the describing agent to note differences in human experience with a different vocabulary, vocabulary that does not assume the consequent concerning the alleged existence of the mind independent from the body. Rorty claims to do this by assigning parallel descriptions to both mind and brain without claiming that there is a center to either.

Whereas the brain can be redescribed as the continual reweaving of the electrical charges across the web of neural synapses, the mind can be redescribed as the constant reweaving of different beliefs and desires, redistributing truth values among the web of interlocking statements. Under Rorty’s description the brain is simply the amalgamation of synapses with no center, i.e., nothing that is independent of this agglomeration. Equally, Rorty holds that the mind is exactly a contingent network of beliefs and desires, having nothing at its core to which the bundled beliefs and desires adhere. It follows there is no self that has these mental elements, rather the self is these elements, and nothing more. Gone is the Cartesian tendency to reify the self and a material object as substantial in order to acknowledge that they each have causal effects. Gone is the mistaken idea of a self as an object represented to ourselves (for example, Descartes’ claim that he is a “thinking thing”). And gone also is the urge to completely separate the mental from the physical ontologically. There are two incommensurate descriptions of causal interaction. In this way, Rorty’s non-reductive materialist account of the self accords well with his nominalism, which rejects the sentence-fact dichotomy as firmly as his anti-essentialism rejects the subject-object split.

Of course, in keeping with Rorty’s narrative, there is no reason why one should limit the descriptions of the self, the mind, and the brain to Rorty’s vocabulary usage. If sometime in the future it serves the purpose of those who live at the time to redescribe Rorty’s account, say along strictly neuron-physiological lines that may accurately pair specific beliefs and desires to identifiable brain functions, then its utility would demand the adoption of this narrative. But until then, Rorty would argue for a holistic approach that does not seek a one-to-one identity between brain functions and mental occurrences, or a reduction of one to the other.

5. Critics

A philosophy that is controversial and iconoclastic as Richard Rorty’s is bound to have an abundance of critics. Space permits the consideration of only a few, those considered serious objections to his neopragmatism. Here is a representative sample of philosophers who pose challenges to key aspects of Rorty’s philosophy.

a. Hilary Putnam, John McDowell, and James Conant

Hilary Putnam doubts Rorty’s ability to sustain his claim to be a pragmatic realist. Turning to Rorty’s pivotal view of justification, Putnam, in Rorty and His Critics (Brandom: 2000), characterizes it as having two aspects: contextual and reforming. About the former, Putnam says that Rorty, by making justification a sociological matter, has apparently made a commitment to majority sentiment. Nevertheless, Putnam declares, by allowing that the majority can be wrong, Rorty is being either incoherent or illicitly introducing a standard that is independent of the social context. Knowing that Rorty rejects ahistorical foundations Putnam takes up the reformist aspect of Rortyan justification to see if Rorty can escape his apparent inconsistency. Rorty’s reformist position suggests that progress in talking and acting results not from being more adequate to some non-human (natural or transcendent) independent standard than one’s predecessors. Rather progress occurs because it seems to us to be clearly better. To this definition of progress Putnam responds that whether the outcome of some reform is deemed to be good or bad is logically independent from whether most people see it as a reform. Otherwise, the meaning of “progress” reduces to a subjective notion and “reform” to an arbitrary preference for a way of life. Therefore, the implication is that if we are to meaningfully use the terms “progress” and “reform,” there has to be better and worse non-subjective standards and norms. So it follows that there are non-sociological, objective ways to appreciate reality. Otherwise in a Rortyan anti-representationalist world of competing “stories” enabling one to cope or failing to help one cope with the “environment,” Rorty’s own narrative of redescriptions becomes one among many non-privileged, solipsistic perspectives, and thus loses its persuasive power.

James Conant and John McDonald complement Putnam’s position. James Conant argues that Rorty’s narrative, when taken to its logical conclusion ultimately undermines the tolerant, liberal, egalitarian society Rorty claims to value. Conant offers that a liberal democratic community must contain three internally-linked, non-transcendent concepts necessary for human voice: freedom, community, and truth. He argues that in the absence of this interlocking troika an alternative triad arises: the prevalence of solitude, uniformity, and an Orwellian doublethink. This latter threesome force upon those inculcated into such a social order barren conformity to meta-ideology that denies the very ability to reformulate language in ways that might threaten the veracity of that order. This is accomplished by relativizing truth; by reducing truth to the status of empty compliments and by utilizing cautionary doubt as a method by which each individual replaces inconvenient memories with group ‘justified’ assertions.

John McDowell refines Putnam’s position, by offering a distinction that actually makes Rorty, Putnam, and Kant allies! He attempts this difficult association by distinguishing the fear of a contingent life and the subsequent appeal to a Freudian father-like force that provides us iron-clad answers and norms to live up to from the desire to have us answerable to the way things are. McDowell suggests that Kant too wished to combat the denial of human finitude, and the consequent withdrawal from the contingent into the safety of an eternal realm, by claiming that appearance was not a barrier preventing us from gazing at reality objectively, but is the very reality we as rational human beings aspire to know. In this way McDowell thinks that Kant, admittedly anti-metaphysical, was as anti-priesthood as Dewey—extending the Protestant Reformation’s idiosyncratic connection to a non-human reality into Philosophy—and in line with Rorty’s anti-epistemology stance—that we are always ensconced within the human frame of reference. The upshot of McDowell’s distinction of objectivity from epistemic escapism is that even as we are located inextricably within a vocabulary there can be joined a unified discourse where the combination of a disquotational, descriptive use of the word "true" and the use of "true" that treats this term as a norm of inquiry is possible.

Conant builds Putnam’s and McDowell’s arguments for the ascendancy of objectivity (properly understood) over solidarity by linking Orwell’s “Newspeak” and Rorty’s New Pragmatism. Conant constructs his argument first by offering the non-controversial claim that freedom of belief is achievable only when one can decide for oneself concerning the facts in a community that nurtures this sort of freedom. This community can only be sustained when its norms of inquiry are not biased toward lock-step solidarity with one’s peers, but are geared toward the encouragement of independent attempts at relating one’s claims about the way things are with the way things are, in fact (or as Conant writes: ‘turning to the facts’). Real human freedom can be expressed when one is able to autonomously believe and to test one’s belief for its truth and falsity in a public forum unconstrained by sociological determinants. Freedom, Conant claims, is therefore a human capacity that emerges from the human condition and need not be attributable to any Realist thesis. Thus, Conant agrees with Rorty that there is nothing deep within us; there isn’t any indestructible nature or eternal substance. Nevertheless, a systematic effort to eliminate the vocabulary containing terms such as ‘eternal truths,’ ‘objective reality,’ and traits ‘essential to humanity’ would be akin to George Orwell’s Newspeak, in that such an elimination would render impossible human freedom by making it impossible to share in language such ideas and concepts. The very possibility of interpretive communication and dialogue among free thinkers engaged in the search for truth would be banished by the sort of control exerted over language that Rorty ironically insists is necessary to change vocabularies and to establish a liberal democratic utopia.

b. Donald Davidson and Bjorn Ramberg

Donald Davidson combines the theory of action with the theory of truth and meaning. For him an account of truth is simultaneously an account of agency and vice versa. By referring to “rationality,” “normativity,” “intentionality,” and “agency” as if they were co-extensive predicates, Davidson is able to claim that descriptions emerge as descriptions of any sort only against a taken-for-granted background of purposeful action. Agency—the ability to offer descriptions rather than merely make noise—only appears if a normative vocabulary is already in use. Normative behavior on the part of the communicators involved makes the case that the intentional stance is unlike the biological stance. In Rorty and His Critics, Davidson raises the “underdetermination/radical interpretation” issue, disputing Rorty’s long-held pragmatic claim that there is no significant philosophical difference between the psychological and the biological, as there is no significant difference between the biological and the chemical, once we abandon the idea of “adequacy to the world.”

Bjorn Ramberg, in support of Davidson’s contention in “Post-ontological Philosophy of Mind: Rorty Versus Davidson,” suggests that the linkage between mind and body is not the irreducibility of the intentional to the physical, but the understanding of the inescapability of the normative. Considering each other as persons with mutual obligations presupposes all pragmatic choices of descriptive vocabularies. We could never deploy some descriptive narrative unless we first deployed a normative vocabulary. As followers of norms, we cannot stop prescribing and just describe. Describing is part and parcel of a rule-governed conversation, an exchange conducted by people who talk to each other assuming the vocabulary of agency. Thus, members of a community are to be considered as interlocutors and not as “parametrics” (causal happenings). Rorty is correct in that there are many descriptive vocabularies (ways to bring salience to different causal patterns of the world) and many different communities of language-users. Yet, until recently, Rorty did not accept Davidson’s position that all individuals who engage others in descriptive language-use must speak prescriptively (see section 3e above), or that it is the inescapability of the vocabulary of normality (rather than the claims about the irreducibility of intentionality, rejected by Rorty) that marks off agency from biology. This leads directly to Davidson’s Doctrine of Triangulation. We are a plurality of agents (one corner of a triangle) each engaged in the project of describing to each other the “world” (a second corner), and interpreting each other’s descriptions of it (the third corner). As Ramberg writes:

We can while triangulating criticize any given claim about any description, we cannot ask for an agreement on the process of triangulation itself, for it would be another case of triangulation. The inescapability of norms is the inescapability—for both the describers and agents—of triangulation.

Davidson’s insight, as elucidated by Ramberg, has caused Rorty to revise his view that norms are set within solidarities alone. Rorty now holds that norms hover, so to speak, “over the whole process of triangulation.” While he still does not accept the positing of a second norm of factual reality as suggested by John McDowell, the emergent property of norms springing from dialogue cannot be reduced to, or identified with its biological (in a fashion similar to flocking, schooling, etc) or chemical (like H2O from hydrogen and oxygen, and so forth) counterparts.

c. Daniel Dennett

Daniel Dennett, in “Faith in the Truth” and “Postmodernism and Truth,” rejects postmodern critiques of physicalist science. Dennett’s target is relativism. Specifically, he charges that Rorty’s stance against the “chauvinism of scientism” leads to blurring the line between serious scientific debate and frivolous historicist exchanges that include science merely as one of many voices in the conversation of humankind. Thus, there is a danger in jettisoning “the matter of fact versus no matter of fact distinction.” What is lost is the ability to make true assertions about reality in terms other than the sociological. Dennett objects to the postmodern notion that what is true today—that leads us to assert, for example, that DNA is a double helix—may not be true tomorrow if the conversation shifts. Rather, he claims that there are actual justifications of what certain sociological facts obtain when it comes to the natural sciences (that is, that there is more agreement among scientists, that the scientific language-game is a better predictor of future events than other vocabularies, and so forth). To confirm our observations we must form good representations of reality. This is what allows these representations to be justified, beyond being good tools that lead to further coping strategies vis-à-vis nature. Otherwise, Rorty’s attitude—expressed as “give us the tools, make the moves, and then say whatever you please about their representational abilities. . . (f)or what you say will be, in the pejorative sense, ‘merely philosophical’”—dismisses scientific objectivity while aiding and abetting postmodern relativists who threaten to replace theory with jargon. Dennett considers writers holding such attitudes to be in “flatfooted ignorance of the proven methods of scientific truth-seeking and their power.”

d. Jurgen Habermas, Nancy Fraser, and Norman Geras

Jürgen Habermas writes in “Richard Rorty’s Pragmatic Turn,” “In forfeiting the binding power of its judgments, metaphysics also loses it substance.” With its loss philosophy can be rescued from its drift only by a post-metaphysics “metaphysics.” This is what Rorty is attempting to do. In his hands, philosophy must become more than academic; it must become relevant in a practical way. Recasting Heidegger in post-analytic terms, Rorty see the deflationary trends in contemporary philosophy as leading to its own negation if left unchecked by edifying creativity. It is a pattern that can lead to extinction if there is not new life breathed into old metaphors by restating them, stripped of their Platonic bias. Central to this bias, according to Habermas’ understanding of Rorty, is the Platonic distinction between “convincing” and “persuading.” Rorty wishes to replace the representational model of knowledge with a communication model that means to replace objectivity with successful intersubjective solidarity. But, Habermas contends that the vocabulary which Rorty employs blurs the line between participant and observer. By assimilating interpersonal relationships into adaptive, instrumental behaviors, Rorty cannot distinguish between the use of language directed towards successful actions and its use oriented toward achieving understanding. Without a conceptual marker to distinguish manipulation from argumentation, “between motivating through reason and causal exertion of influence, between learning and indoctrination,” Habermas concludes that Rorty’s project results in a loss of critical standards that make a real difference in our everyday practices.

Nancy Fraser provides in her “From Irony to Prophecy to Politics: A Response to Richard Rorty” a Habermasian case of Rorty’s difficulty in distinguishing between edification and indoctrination. While Fraser is sympathetic to Rorty’s anti-essentialist stance and his linguistic turn relative to politics and power, she has objected to his depiction of the process he suggests for the advancement of causes, Feminist or otherwise. In her response to Rorty’s “Feminism and Pragmatism,” Fraser rejects the notion advanced by Rorty that women must make a complete break with the memes that have been employed by males in Western cultures and redefine themselves out of whole cloth. The reason she gives for her objection is that the neo-Darwinian revolutionary vision that Rorty offers to Feminism is itself too embedded in the chauvinism of the past. Likening the suggested redefinition of memes to form a new feminist solidarity to the Oedipal struggle between a son and his father—manifested in the need for women to confront and overthrow those males who currently assert their semantic authority—Fraser dismisses Rorty’s zero-sum-game struggle over semantic space as one that replicates the male competitive model and does not easily fit into the psychological profile of pluralist, communal dialogue that contemporary feminists favor.

Furthermore, Fraser questions the notion of women forming solidarities, or as Rorty puts it “feminist clubs,” for the purpose of redefining themselves. She wonders which of the various definitions (for example, radical, liberal, Marxist, socialist, traditionalist, and so forth) will count as “taking the viewpoint of women as “women”? Would this not be an imposition of semantic authority by one elite, privileged “club” onto all other women? And would this not be a return to the Oedipal, confrontational style she is rejecting by inflaming the definitional differences among women along masculinist lines of class, sexual preference, and racial categories? Therefore, Fraser wants there to be a political movement along the lines of democratic socialism, where the various voices of women (and other feminists) move to create (and not discover or be assigned even in the most supportive terms) their own post-rationalist meanings, thus empowering women to speak for themselves, not as “prophets” but as themselves.

Similarly, Norman Geras takes exception to Rorty’s liberalism and his democracy of hope. Geras’s “Solidarity in the Conversation of Humanity (1995) is concerned with the possibility (more to the point, the impossibility) of a (Deweyan) humanism without any human nature. In this work, Geras refers to a lecture given by Rorty in the 1993 Oxford Amnesty series on “Human Rights”: the culture of human rights is, Rorty says, a “welcome fact of the post-Holocaust world”; it is “morally superior to other cultures.” Such affirmations, Geras notes, are part of the more general viewpoint Rorty recommends to western cultures: the viewpoint of liberalism without philosophical foundations, a pragmatically inspired hope for a tolerant and open democratic society on the basis of historical contingencies only. But in answering Geras’ rhetorical question “To whose morality is Rorty referring?” it seems, at first glance, that Rorty would answer that it is the solidarity of western liberal individuals’ values. Upon reflection, however, it would be a surprise if most of these liberals agreed with Rorty’s view on the denatured self and the ungroundedness of supporting humanitarian principles. Therefore, with principles being ad hoc adaptations of past ethnocentric norms and without the firm peg of a centered self upon which to hang his web of beliefs, Rorty has to be advancing his own idiosyncratic values. Furthermore, his values are packaged persuasively by the artful use of equivocations, allegedly as part and parcel of the human right’s culture based on a universalist notion of transcultural human integrity, notions that Rorty stoutly rejects. In short, Rorty’s reading of the human rights culture appropriates the notion of rights for his own anti-foundational, pragmatic ends: the command of semantic space of his view of humanity’s future. By doing so, Geras contends, in line with Habermas, there can be no clear distinction between the Rortyan democratic contribution to a dialogue on human ideals and a subtle insinuation of his idiosyncratic viewpoint into everyday practices making the world in his own image.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Rorty

  • Rorty, Richard, Ed., The Linguistic Turn: Essays in Philosophical Method. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1967.
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979.
  • Rorty, Richard. Consequences of Pragmatism. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
  • Rorty, Richard. Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Rorty, Richard. Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Rorty, Richard. On Heidegger and Others: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Rorty, Richard. Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Rorty, Richard. Achieving our Country: Leftists Thoughts in Twentieth-Century America. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1998.
  • Rorty, Richard. “McDowell, Davidson, and Spontaneity.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58: 2, (June, 1998): 389-394.
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and Social Hope. London: Penguin Books, 1999.
  • Rorty, Richard. Take Care of Freedom and Truth Will Take Care of Itself: Interviews with Richard Rorty. Ed., Edwuardo Mendieta. Stanford: Sanford University Press, 2006.

b. Works about Rorty

  • Brandom, Robert B., ed. Rorty and His Critics. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2000.
  • Calder, Gideon. Rorty and Redescription. London: Weidenfeld & Nicolson, 2003.
  • Geras, Norman. Solidarity in the Conversation of Humanity. London: Verso, 1995.
  • Goodman, Russell B., ed. Pragmatism: A Contemporary Reader. New York: Routledge, 1995.
  • Hall, David L. Richard Rorty: Prophet and Poet of the New Pragmatism. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1994.
  • Malachowski, Alen, ed. Reading Rorty. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1990.
  • Murphy, John P. Pragmatism: From Peirce to Davidson. Boulder Colorado: Westview Press, 1990.
  • Saatkamp, Herman J., ed. Rorty & Pragmatism: The Philosopher Responds to His Critics. Nashville, Tennessee: Vanderbilt University Press, 1995.

c. Further Reading

  • Darwin, Charles. The Origin of the Species. New York: Random House, 1979.
  • Davidson, Donald. Inquiries Concerning Truth and Interpretation. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Dennett, Daniel. Consciousness Explained. New York: Little, Brown, 1991.
  • Dewey, John. The Quest for Certainty. New York: Capricorn Books, 1960.
  • Habermas, Jurgen. The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity. Tr., Frederick G. Lawrence. Cambridge, Massachusetts: The MIT Press, 1992.
  • Hegel, G. W. F. Phenomenology of Spirit. Tr., A. V. Miller. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. Translators John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson. New York: Harper & Row, 1962.
  • Kuhn, Thomas. The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1962.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Words and Life. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press, 1994.
  • Quine, Willard. V. O., Word and Object. Cambridge, Massachusetts: The MIT Press, 1960.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. Science, Perception and Reality. New York: Humanities Press, 1963.

Author Information

Edward Grippe
Norwalk Community College
U. S. A.

Gregory of Nyssa (c. 335—c. 395 C.E.)

Gregory_of_NyssaGregory of Nyssa spent his life in Cappadocia, a region in central Asia Minor. He was the most philosophically adept of the three so-called Cappadocians, who included brother Basil the Great and friend Gregory of Nazianzus. Together, the Cappadocians are credited with defining Christian orthodoxy in the Eastern Roman Empire, as Augustine (354—430 C.E.) was to do in the West. Gregory was a highly original thinker, drawing inspiration from the pagan Greek philosophical schools, as well as from the Jewish and Eastern Christian traditions, and formulating an original synthesis that was to influence later Byzantine, and possibly even modern European, thought. A central idea in Gregory's writing is the distinction between the transcendent nature and immanent energies of God, and much of his thought is a working out of the implications of that idea in other areas--notably, the world, humanity, history, knowledge, and virtue. This leads him to expand the nature-energies distinction into a general cosmological principle, to apply it particularly to human nature, which he conceives as having been created in God's image, and to rear a theory of unending intellectual and moral perfectibility on the premise that the purpose of human life is literally to become like the infinite nature of God.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. God
  3. World
  4. Humanity
  5. History
  6. Knowledge
  7. Virtue
  8. Conclusion
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gregory of Nyssa was born about 335 C.E. in Cappadocia (in present-day Turkey). He came from a large Christian family of ten children--five boys and five girls. Gregory's family is significant, for two of the most influential people on his thought are two of his elder siblings--his sister Macrina (c.327—379) and Basil (c.330—379), the oldest boy in the family. Along with Basil and fellow-Cappadocian and friend Gregory of Nazianzus (c.329—c.391), Gregory of Nyssa forms the third of a trio of Christian thinkers, collectively known as the Cappadocians, who established the main lines of orthodoxy in the Christian East. Basil, who became the powerful bishop of Caesarea, was the most politically skilled churchman of the group. He appointed his younger brother to the see by which he is now known, and rightly predicted that Gregory would confer more distinction on the obscure town of Nyssa than he would receive from it. Gregory of Nazianzus was a brilliant orator, best known for his five "theological orations," which succinctly summarized the Cappadocian consensus. But the deepest thinker of the three was Gregory of Nyssa. Gregory stands at a crossroads in the theological development of the Christian East: he sums up many of the ideas of his great predecessors, such as the Jewish philosopher Philo of Alexandria (c.20 B.C.E.—c.54 C.E.) and the Christian Origen (c.185—254 C.E.), and initiates the development of themes that will appear in the most prominent of the later Byzantine thinkers, notably the Pseudo-Dionysius (c.500) and Gregory Palamas (1296 - 1359).

As the eldest boy, Basil was the only one of Gregory's siblings to receive a formal education. So Basil in all probability became the teacher of his younger brother. If so, he certainly did an excellent job, for in this case the pupil went on to outshine the teacher. Gregory is thoroughly at home with the philosophers that were in vogue in his day: Plato (427—347 B.C.E.)—especially as "updated" and systematized by Plotinus (204 - 270 CE)--Aristotle (384 - 322 BCE), and the Stoics. On reading his works, one cannot but be struck by the abundance of allusions to the Platonic dialogues. Yet it would be a mistake to say, as Cherniss famously does, that "Gregory . . . merely applied Christian names to Plato's doctrine and called it Christian theology" (The Platonism of Gregory of Nyssa: 62). As will be seen below, there is a pronounced linear view of history in Gregory's thought, which can only be of Hebrew provenance. Moreover, the reader will discover an originality in Gregory that anticipates not only his Byzantine successors, but also such moderns as John Locke (1632 - 1704) and Immanuel Kant (1724 - 1804).

The turning point in Gregory's life came about 379, when both his brother Basil and his sister Macrina died. The burning issue at the time was the Arian heresy, which by then had entered its last and most logically rigorous phase. Arianism was a Christological heresy, named for its founder Arius (c. 256 - 336), that held that Christ was neither divine nor human, but a sort of demigod. The principal defender of Arianism at the time, Eunomius of Cyzicus (c. 325 - c. 394), argued that the Arian doctrine could even be derived from the very concept of God, as will be seen below. For most of this period, the brunt of the battle for orthodoxy had been led by Basil; but when he died, and shortly thereafter Gregory's beloved sister, Gregory felt that the responsibility for defending orthodoxy against the Arian heresy had fallen on his shoulders. Thus began the most productive period of one of the most brilliant of Christian thinkers--far too little known and appreciated in the West.

That period was launched by the publication of his Against Eunomius, Gregory's four-book refutation of that last phase of the Arian heresy. It was followed by many more works, the most significant being On the Work of the Six Days, Gregory's account of the creation of the world; On the Making of Man, his account of the creation of humankind; The Great Catechism, the most systematic statement of Gregory's philosophy of history; On the Soul and the Resurrection, a dialogue with Macrina detailing Gregory's eschatology; Biblical commentaries on the life of Moses, the inscriptions of the Psalms, Ecclesiastes, the Song of Songs, the Beatitudes, and the Lord's Prayer; theological works on Trinitarian and Christological doctrine; and shorter ascetic and moral treatises. Many of these will be discussed below.

Gregory was present at the final defeat of Arianism in the Council of Constantinople of 381. Nothing more is heard from him after about 395 CE.

2. God

Gregory's concept of God is born out of the Arian controversy. Arianism arose out of the need to make sense of the apparently conflicting Biblical depictions of Christ. For example, how is one to understand Jesus' claim that "I and the Father are one" (John 10:30) when it seems to be contradicted by the admission that "the Father is greater than I" (John 14:28)? This sort of problem prompted Arius to postulate that Christ was neither divine nor human, but something in between--a demigod, the oldest and most perfect created being, to be sure, but created nonetheless. By Gregory's day, the leading spokesman for Arian theology was Eunomius of Cyzicus, who argued for Arianism on strictly philosophical grounds. The created nature of Christ could be derived by an analysis of the very concept of God, Eunomius argued; for it is God's essential nature to be unbegotten, whereas Christ is confessed to be "begotten of the Father." If this sort of argument were allowed to stand, what was to become the orthodox faith--the faith enunciated at Nicaea in 325 CE that Christ was literally "of the same substance" with the Father--would be radically transformed.

Gregory counters Eunomius, not by simply staking out the opposite position and defending it with Scriptural artillery, as most of his fellow Nicenes had done, but, more interestingly, by repudiating the central presupposition of Eunomian theology--that one can derive by a process of analysis concepts that are essentially predicated of God. God is incomprehensible; thus, it is presumptuous in the extreme to suppose that God can be defined by a set of human concepts. When we are speaking of God's inner nature, all that we can say is what that nature is not (Against Eunomius II [953 - 960, 1101 - 1108], IV 11 [524]). In saying this, Gregory anticipates the negative theology of the Pseudo-Dionysius and much medieval thought.

Nevertheless, if that were the whole story--if we were left with God's utter incomprehensibility and nothing more--then Gregory's theology would be a very much stunted exposition of Christianity. After all, in the Beatitudes Christ promises, "Blessed are the pure in heart, for they shall see God." (Matt. 5:8) If God's inner nature is knowable only negatively, how is this possible? More generally, if God is simply some remote, unknowable entity, what possible relation to the world could God ever have? Gregory answers these questions by distinguishing between God's nature (phusis) and God's "energies" (energeiai)--the projection of the divine nature into the world, initially creating it and ultimately guiding it to its appointed destination (Beatitudes VI [1269]). The idea of God's energies in Gregory's theology approximates to the Western concept of grace, except that it emphasizes God's actual presence in those parts of creation which are perfected just because of that presence. By distinguishing between God's nature (sometimes he uses the word "substance"--ousia) and God's energies, Gregory anticipates the more famous substance-energies distinction of the fourteenth century Byzantine theologian Gregory Palamas.

Does all of this have any sort of rational basis? Though he frequently appeals to Scripture to support his claims, Gregory does in fact argue for the existence of God. And although he concedes that God's inner nature will always remain a mystery to us, Gregory holds that we can attain some knowledge of God's energies. This does not mean, however, that God does not have a transcendent nature. As will be seen below, for Gregory everything that exists has an inner nature that cannot be known immediately and is knowable only through its energies. God is only the most striking instance of this. If it can be shown that God exists, it follows necessarily in Gregory's mind that God has a nature. But God's existence is derived from our knowledge of God's energies, and those energies are in turn known both indirectly and directly.

The indirect route relies on the order apparent in the cosmos. The fact that the universe is orderly indicates that it is governed according to some rational plan, which implies the existence of a divine Planner (Against Eunomius II [984 - 985, 1009, 1069]; Great Catechism Prologue [12], 12 [44]; Work of the Six Days [73]; Life of Moses II 168 [377 - 380]; Ecclesiastes I [624], II [644 - 645]; Song of Songs I [781 - 784], XI [1009 - 1013], XIII [1049 - 1052]; Beatitudes VI [1268]). In noting this, Gregory is relying on an argument that had been around since the early Stoics--the argument from design (cf. Cicero, Nature of the Gods II 2.4 - 21.56). Now there are several things to notice about this argument. In the first place it is an analogical one: just as a work of art leads us to infer the existence of an artist, so the artistry displayed in the order of nature suggests the existence of a Creator. But if Gregory's argument is nothing more than a generalized appeal to the harmony of the universe, it is not a very persuasive basis for proving the existence of God. For that there are laws of nature is nothing surprising: to have anything at all, from cosmos to quark, is to have order. If this is all that Gregory means, his argument at best reduces to the cosmological, or "first cause," argument that any chain of creating or sustaining causes requires a first member, which "everyone would call God," as Thomas Aquinas puts it (Summa Theologiae I q. 2 a. 3). Such an argument, however, is not very convincing. Why not an infinite chain of causes, for instance? Or even more to the point, why can't things exist on their own? It doesn't seem that the cosmological argument rules out either of these two possibilities.

However, what Gregory has in mind seems to be something more specific. In certain passages Gregory suggests that it is not order in general but the blending of opposites into a harmonious whole that would have never happened spontaneously, but only through the power of a Creator. The heavens accommodate contrary motions, and these motions give rise to unmoving, static laws (Inscriptions of the Psalms I 3 [440 - 441]); heavy bodies are borne downward and light bodies upward, and simple causes bring about complex effects (Soul and Resurrection [25 - 28]). In all these situations opposites not only fail to annihilate each other, but they even contribute to an overall harmony. The emphasis here is not on order in general, but on unexpected order. Given what we know about motion and rest, heaviness and lightness, and the rest, Gregory argues, we would expect to find them excluding, rather than complementing, each other. The fact that they behave in unanticipated ways can only be explained by the exercise of divine power.

Now one could object at this point that these phenomena are by no means surprising; they are surprising to Gregory only because the scientific knowledge of the fourth century is not as advanced as that of the twenty-first. However, it is not all that difficult to abstract the general point from Gregory's particular examples and to bring his argument up-to-date by replacing motion and rest, heaviness and lightness, and so forth with modern examples of phenomena that cannot be explained by any known law of physics (the "lumpiness" of the universe, for example). Yet our hypothetical objector still has a point, as is particularly obvious to us who are examining the thought of a fourth century figure seventeen centuries later. The fact that a phenomenon seems to violate what we think we know of the laws of nature does not imply that it really does violate those laws. Our knowledge may simply be too limited. So the fact that we find order in nature that we don't expect may simply be a function of the limitation of our knowledge rather than of the intervention of God in the world.

The direct method whereby God's energies are known is by examining our own moral purification. It was observed above that Gregory's concept of the divine energies is very similar to the Western concept of grace, except that for Gregory, as for Eastern thinkers in general, grace is due to the actual presence of God and not some action at a distance. As Gregory puts it, "Deity is in everything, penetrating it, embracing it, and seated in it" (Great Catechism 25 [65]). So we directly experience the divine energies in the only thing in the universe that we can view from within--ourselves. But God's energies are always a force for good. Thus we encounter them in the experience of virtues such as purity, passionlessness, sanctity, and simplicity in our own moral character: "if . . . these things be in you," Gregory concludes, "God is indeed in you" (Beatitudes VI [1272]).

Some scholars (for example, Balas, Metousia Theou, p. 128) argue that for Gregory energeiai should be translated "operations" rather than "energies," thus bringing Gregory's concept of God's energeiai more into line with Aquinas' concept of God's power (Summa Theologiae I qq. 8, 25), or of God's effects (cf. Summa Theologiae I q. 2, a. 2; q. 12, a. 12). But such an interpretation will not do for two reasons. First, Gregory insists that God exists in God's energeiai just as much as in God's nature (Against Eunomius I 17 [313], cf. Letter to Xenodorus). He could not say that if God's energeiai were merely God's operations. Second, it was shown above that Gregory uses the concept of God's energeiai to explain how the "pure in heart" can "see God." Once again, one cannot "see God" in God's operations, except in a metaphorical sense; but one can literally "see God" with the spiritual sense of sight (on the spiritual senses, see below) if God is, as Gregory claims, actually "present within oneself" (Beatitudes VI [1269]).

3. World

Gregory's account of the creation of the world reflects the nature-energies logic developed in his polemic against Eunomius. The account unfolds via an allegorical reflection on the first chapter of Genesis, and closely follows the much earlier work of Philo of Alexandria. Like Philo (Creation of the World 3.13), Gregory does not take literally the temporal sequence depicted therein; rather, he envisions creation as having taken place all at once (Work of the Six Days [69 - 72, 76]). Within this atemporal framework, the key "event" was the creation of the firmament on the second day (Work of the Six Days [80 - 85]), for it is the firmament that divides the intelligible world, created on the first day (Work of the Six Days [68 - 85]), from the sensible world, created on days three through six (Work of the Six Days [85 - 124])--again, broadly similar to Philo (Creation of the World 7.29 - 10.36, 44.129 - 44.130). Now the intelligible world was by Gregory's day pictured as a pleroma of Platonic forms existing as ideas in the mind of God; for ever since the advent of Middle Platonism in the first century BCE, the Platonic forms had been transmuted from self-subsistent entities (as Plato conceived them) to ideas in the divine mind. The classic problem with this view, going as far back as Plato himself, was to explain how these forms become instantiated in the material world.

Gregory recasts this problem in theological terms: how could God, who is immaterial, have created the material world? The answer lies in the Aristotelian distinction between the category of substance and the other categories--relation, quality, quantity, place, time, action, passion (Categories 1 - 9)--which Gregory designates with the Stoic term "qualities" (poiotetes). In themselves, qualities are ideas in the mind of God. But they can also be projected out from God; and when that happens, they become visible. Now Gregory observes that although we ordinarily speak of these immanent qualities as inhering in substances, all we really perceive are the qualities of things, not their substances. It is but a short step to the conclusion that a physical object is nothing more than the convergence of its qualities. Thus matter as such doesn't really exist; bodies are really just "holograms" formed by this convergence of qualities. Consequently there is no problem of how an immaterial God could have created a material world, for the world isn't material at all (Against Eunomius II [949]; Work of the Six Days [69]; Making of Man 24 [212 - 213]; Soul and Resurrection [124]).

Elsewhere, Gregory explicitly uses the term "energies" to cover those qualities that are immanent in the physical world. Energies, Gregory contends, are the "powers" and "movements" by which substances are "manifested"; the energy of each thing is its "distinguishing property" (idioma)--a technical Stoic term for a specific, as opposed to a generic, quality. Gregory goes so far as to assert that apart from its energies a nature not only cannot be known, but does not even exist. (Letter to Xenodorus).

Gregory's position bears a curious resemblance to that of John Locke; for according to Locke we know only the nominal essences of things, not their real essences. Thus substance is a "something . . . we know not what" (Essay II xxiii 3). All we really know of substances are their attributes, which constitute their nominal essences (Essay II xxxi 6 - 10, III iii 15 - 19). In this light consider the following passage from Against Eunomius:

Even the inquiry as to that thing in the flesh itself which assumes all the corporeal qualities has not been pursued to any definite result. For if any one has made a mental analysis of that which is seen into its component parts, and, having stripped the object of its qualities, has attempted to consider it by itself, I fail to see what will have been left for investigation. For when you take from a body its color, its shape, its hardness, its weight, its quantity, its position, its forces active or passive, its relation to other objects, what remains that can still be called a body, we can neither see of ourselves nor are taught by Scripture. . . . Wherefore also, of the elements of this world we know only so much by our senses as to enable us to receive what they severally supply for our living. But we possess no knowledge of their substance . . . . (Against Eunomius II [949])

In Gregory's account of creation, the nature-energies distinction, developed to counter Eunomius' defense of the Arian heresy, becomes extended into a general cosmological principle. The most important consequence of this extension is its application to the capstone of the cosmic order--human nature.

4. Humanity

The fundamental fact about human nature according to Gregory of Nyssa is that humans were created in the image of God. This means that because in God a transcendent nature exists which projects energies out into the world, we would expect the same structural relation to exist among human beings vis-a-vis their bodies. And in fact that is precisely what Gregory argues concerning the human nous (a word that is traditionally translated "mind" but which by the fourth century CE had submerged its intellectual connotations into the religious idea of its separateness from the physical world). In fact, so central is the nature-energies distinction to his conception of human personhood, that Gregory, again taking his inspiration from Philo (Creation of the World 46.134 - 46.135), uses it to explain the two accounts of the creation of human beings in Genesis 1 and 2 respectively. The original creation, in which God makes the human race "in our image, after our likeness" (Gen. 1:26) is of the transcendent human nature. The second creation, in which God "formed man of dust from the ground, and breathed into his nostrils the breath of life," (Gen. 2:7) is of the energies of the soul coupled with the body in which they are present (Making of Man 16 - 17 [177 - 189], 22 [204 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [157 - 160]).

The most important characteristic of the nature of the nous is that it provides for the unity of consciousness. How are my varied perceptions, deriving from various sense organs, all coordinated with each other? Aristotle himself had addressed this problem by postulating the existence of a common sense (On the Soul III 1 - 2). But Gregory moves beyond Aristotle's psychological explanation. Using the metaphor of a city in which family members come in by various gates but all meet somewhere inside, Gregory's answer is that this can occur only if we presuppose a transcendent self to which all of one's experiences are referred (Making of Man 10 [152 - 153]). But this unity of consciousness is entirely mysterious and so is much like the mysterious nature of the Godhead (Making of Man 11 [153 - 156]). One is reminded of Kant's theory of the transcendental unity of apperception (Critique of Pure Reason, Transcendental Deduction).

Yet the nous is also extended throughout the body by its energies, which constitute our ordinary psychological experiences (Making of Man 15 [176 - 177]; Soul and Resurrection [41 - 44]). Furthermore, the nous may at different times be more or less present to the body. During waking life the energies of the nous are present throughout the body. But during sleep the presence of nous to body is much more tenuous, and at death is even more so (though not absolutely nonexistent) (Great Catechism 8 [33]; Making of Man 12 - 15 [160 - 177]; Soul and Resurrection [45 - 48]).

The parallels between the divine and the human extend all the way down to the evidential basis for the existence of the human nous. For the existence of the nous rests on a "design" argument analogous to the argument for the energies of God. Indeed the body resembles a machine; and because the latter is governed by nous, it is probable that the former is also. And just as Gregory bases his indirect argument for the existence of God's energies on the unexpected order of natural phenomena, so here he argues that because the components of a living body are observed to behave in a manner "contrary to [their] nature"--air being harnessed to produce sound, water impelled to move upward, and so forth--we may infer the existence of a nous imposing its will upon recalcitrant matter through its energies (Soul and Resurrection [33 - 40]). This should not be particularly surprising since Gregory regards the human body as a miniature, harmonious version of the cosmos as a whole (Inscriptions of the Psalms I 3 [441 - 444]).

There are two further characteristics of the human nous according to Gregory. First, because the human nous is created in the image of God, it possesses a certain "dignity of royalty" (to tes basileias axioma) that is lacking in the rest of creation. For it means that there is an aspect of the human person that is not of this world. Of no other organism can that be said. The souls of other species are totally immanent in their bodies. They have only energies, in other words. Only the human nous has a transcendent nature in addition to its energies. But that more than anything else is what makes us like God. Now God is of supreme worth. Consequently human beings have an inherent "dignity of royalty" just by virtue of being human (Making of Man 2 - 4 [132 - 136]).

Second, the nous is free. In an early work Gregory argues strenuously against astral determinism (On Fate [145 - 173]). In his more mature reflections, Gregory derives the freedom of the nous from the freedom of God. For God, being dependent on nothing, governs the universe through the free exercise of will; and the nous is created in God's image (Making of Man 4 [136]). Once again, absent the theological emphasis, on both counts there is a broad similarity with Kant (cf. Groundwork II - III); and that similarity will only become more obvious when the ways in which Gregory applies these ideas are explored within the context of his philosophy of history.

5. History

Early on, Christian theology developed a distinctive way of conceptualizing God. Rather than a simple monotheism, Christianity held that God, though unitary, could be understood as also existing as a Trinity of three Persons--a Father, the font of the Godhead; a Son, the Word (John 1:1-5) and Wisdom (Prov. 8:22-31) of God, incarnated as Jesus Christ; and a Holy Spirit, who is sent into the world by the Father. Now Gregory lived at a crossroads in the theological understanding of this doctrine. Prior to the era of the ecumenical councils, the first of which was Nicaea, discussed above, the Trinity tended to be viewed as three stages in the outflow of God into the world, with the Father as its source and the Holy Spirit as its termination. Yet beginning with the Church councils, the Trinity gradually came to be understood differently, as three distinctions to be made within God's inner nature itself. Not surprisingly, both models of the Trinity can be found in Gregory. Yet the first is clearly more congenial to his distinctive nature-energies understanding of God than the second. Indeed, one might question whether the second makes any sense at all in light of the typical Byzantine insistence on the incomprehensibility of God's inner nature: if God's nature is incomprehensible, how can we say it is both three and one--unless by doing so we wish to emphasize God's very incomprehensibility?

Not only is the earlier model of the Trinity more consistent with Gregory's view of God as a transcendent nature whose energies are projected into the world; it also adds to it a dynamic and historical dimension that the bare nature-energies distinction fails to capture on its own. As noted above, the Father is always transcendent; and at the other extreme, the Holy Spirit is God's glory (Song of Songs VI [1117]): it "manifests [the Son's] energy" (Great Catechism 2 [17]) in the world. It is the second Person of the Trinity who is the most interesting because it provides Gregory with the conceptual apparatus to explain God's operation in history, for the point at which the second Person enters the world becomes the point in time in which God is more intimately present to the world than before.

Gregory's philosophy of history begins with the fall of Adam from perfection. Earlier it was noted that according to Gregory humankind was fashioned in two creations--one of the nature of the nous, the other of its energies together with the body. The reason for the second creation was that God foresaw that humans would sin and so be unable to reproduce in a disembodied, angelic way; thus, they required bodies to allow them to propagate (Making of Man 16 - 17 [177 - 189], 22 [204 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [157 - 160]). But the provision of bodies brings in its wake the tragic reality of death and sin, the overcoming of which was the purpose of the incarnation of Christ (Great Catechism 8 [33]).

Gregory's Christology is the story of the entry of the second Person of the Trinity into the world. In Gregory's words,

For although this last form of God's presence amongst us is not the same as that former presence, still his existence amongst us equally both then and now is evidenced: now he rules in us in order to hold together that nature in being; then he was transfused in our nature, in order that our nature might by this transfusion of the divine become itself divine--being rescued from death and put beyond the reach of the tyranny of the Adversary. For his return from death becomes to our mortal race the commencement of our return to immortal life. (Great Catechism 25 [65 - 68])

In saying that initially Christ entered "our nature," Gregory is echoing the typical Eastern Christian understanding of Christ's saving work; for according to that tradition, Christ healed the effects of the fall of humankind in the same way as he healed the sick in his earthly ministry--simply by touching. Moreover, because, as Gregory of Nazianzus put it, "what was not assumed was not healed" (Letters 101.5), Christ had to touch all aspects of human existence from birth to death (Great Catechism 27 [69 - 72], 32 [77 - 80]). Thus the former had to wait until the disease of human sinfulness had fully manifested itself (Great Catechism 29 [73 - 76]). And by submitting to the latter, Christ offered himself in bondage to Satan in exchange for the whole of humanity, whom Satan then had under his tyranny (Great Catechism 22 - 24 [60 - 65]). Precisely how, in Christ, the divine thus entered into human nature we can never know--any more than we can understand the presence of our own souls to our bodies (Great Catechism 11 [44]).But after the resurrection of Christ, the second Person of the Trinity is no longer just "transfused in our nature," but now "rules in us." In other words, the second Person is now immanent in the world in the institution of the Church; for "he who sees the Church sees Christ" (Song of Songs XIII [1048]). Indeed, Gregory deploys, once again, his characteristic insistence on the unexpected unity of opposites, this time in the Church's sacraments--life through death, justification through sin, blessing through curse, glory through disgrace, strength through weakness, and so forth--to argue for Christ's continued, miraculous presence in his Church (Song of Songs VIII [948 - 949], XIII [1045 - 1052]). For this reason, Gregory subscribes to a realist theory of the sacraments. As baptism is to the soul, so the Eucharist is to the body (Great Catechism 37 [93]). In the former case, the presence of Christ "transforms what is born with a corruptible nature into a state of incorruption" (Great Catechism 33 [84], cf. 34 [85]). In the latter, Christ "disseminates himself in every believer through that flesh, whose substance comes from bread and wine, blending himself with the bodies of believers, to secure that, by this union with the immortal, man, too, may be a sharer in incorruption"--a process Gregory calls metastoicheiosis, "transelementation" (Great Catechism 37 [97]).

In the Resurrection, Christ "knitted together [the soul and body of humankind] . . . in a union never to be broken" (Great Catechism 16 [52], cf. 35 [89]) and "recalled [our] diseased nature by repentance to the grace of its original state" (Great Catechism 8 [37]). This is difficult to understand unless one notes that Gregory describes Christ's saving work in the language of the Platonic forms (Great Catechism 16 [52], 32 [80 - 81]), which were classically construed as the originals of which the things that participate in them are mere images. Thus the resurrection and deification of Christ's human nature are the prototypes of those to follow. The key idea here seems to be, once again, that human beings were created in God's image. Formerly, that image was seen in the structural relation between the nature and energies of the human nous; now it is projected onto the axis of history.

Participation in Christ's resurrection guarantees the resurrection of the body on the part of humanity. How does this happen? For one thing, as was noted earlier, Gregory holds that the nous is never completely separated from the body anyway, so in a sense there is no paradox in its revivification, But aren't the bodily components scattered to the four winds after the decay of the corpse in the grave? How can they ever be reassembled? Gregory indeed addresses this problem and argues, strangely, that each particle of the body is stamped with one's personal identity, and so it will be possible for the nous to eventually recognize and reassemble them all (Making of Man 26 - 27 [224 - 229], Soul and Resurrection [73 - 80]).

Similarly, the logical consequence of Christ's deification is the apokatastasis--the restoration of humanity to its unfallen state. Because evil is a privation of the good and is therefore limited, Gregory believes that there is a limit to human degradation. At some point, everyone must turn around and strive for the good. Besides, the ultimate good, which is God, is infinitely attractive. Thus, Gregory endorses Origen's (First Principles I 6.3, II 10.4 - 10.8, III 6.5 - 6.6) much-maligned theories of remedial punishment and universal salvation (Great Catechism 8 [36 - 37], 26 [69], 35 [92]; Making of Man 21 - 22 [201 - 205]; Soul and Resurrection [97 - 105, 152, 157 - 160]). In other words, for Gregory as for his intellectual ancestor Origen, everyone--even Satan himself (Great Catechism 26 [68 - 69])--will eventually be saved. This means that there is no such thing as eternal damnation. Hell is really purgatory; punishment is temporary and remedial. As Gregory puts it in a colorful metaphor, the process of purgation is like drawing a rope encrusted with dried mud through a small aperture: it's hard on the rope, but it does come out clean on the other side (Soul and Resurrection [100]).

The final component of Gregory's eschatology is his famous theory of perfection, which is derived from his conviction, which he inherits from Plato (Theaetetus 176b1 - 2) through Origen (First Principles III 6.1), that the purpose of human life is to achieve nothing less than likeness to God (homoiosis theoi). But there would seem to be a problem here: if God's very essence is incomprehensible, how can we know what God is really like? The answer lies in the life of Christ, whose purpose was to demonstrate what God is like--an idea Gregory also borrows from Origen (First Principles I 2.8). Consequently, it is sufficient if we use Christ's life as a model for our own (On Perfection [264 - 265, 269]). Nevertheless, it remains that God's nature is infinitely removed from ours. But that doesn't mean that striving to become like God is pointless; it only means that the process of perfection is unending (Against Eunomius I 15 [301], 22 [340], II [940 - 941], III 6.5 [707]; Great Catechism 21 [57 - 60]; Making of Man 21 [201 - 204]; Soul and Resurrection [96 - 97, 105]; On Perfection [285]). This idea forms the core of Gregory's epistemology and ethics, which will be summarized below.

6. Knowledge

Gregory's epistemological views are nicely brought out in his reflections on the life of Moses. The central feature of Gregory's very sensitive analysis is the sequence of three theophanies that punctuate Moses' life (Song of Songs XII [1025 - 1028]). Moses is pictured as one who has a thirst for utter intimacy with God, and the three theophanies are stages on his journey to that intimacy. The first theophany is the burning bush (Life of Moses II 1 - 116 [297 - 360]). In a traditional vein, Gregory takes light to be a symbol of knowledge. So the first stage of Moses' progress is the acquisition of purely intellectual knowledge of God. This procedure is clearly rational; and Gregory will be found in what follows applying that quintessentially rational criterion--consistency--to the acquisition of religious truth.

To do this, Gregory recognizes, one must resort to philosophy as a source of conceptual tools. But philosophy in his day was almost wholly associated with paganism. So Gregory's attitude toward philosophy is somewhat ambiguous. At one time he portrays philosophy, like Moses' stepmother, as barren (Life of Moses II 10 - 12 [329]), and, like the Egyptian whom Moses killed, as something to be striven against (Life of Moses 13 - 18 [329 - 332]). Later, he recites with approval the common Christian interpretation of the Israelites' spoiling of the Egyptians as a lesson to Christians on the importance of appropriating pagan wisdom in explaining Christian doctrine (Life of Moses II 115 [360]). But Gregory's true position seems to lie between these two extremes: philosophy is useful if properly "circumcised," that is, culled of any "foreskin" alien to the spirit of Christianity (Life of Moses II 39 - 40 [337]).

Of the same ilk is Gregory's hermeneutical principle of distinguishing between the literal narrative (historia) of a Biblical passage and the spiritual contemplation (theoria) of it. In the tradition of Philo (Creation of the World 1.1 - 2.12) and Origen (First Principles I Pref., IV 1.1 - 3.5), he produces several arguments in favor of the allegorization of Scripture: (1) it is practiced by Christ, (2) it is recommended by Paul, (3) it makes passages edifying that would otherwise be immoral, and (4) it makes sense of passages that would otherwise be unintelligible or impossible (Song of Songs Preface [756 - 764]). This procedure is obviously predicated on the imperative of integrating Scripture into the entire matrix of worldly knowledge. Gregory never doubts that this matrix should be internally consistent; and he unselfconsciously employs the rule that of two claims that are mutually inconsistent, the more trumps the less edifying.

Up to this point intellectual development is characterized by the rigorous application of the rational criterion of consistency. But for Gregory the next two theophanies go far beyond the veneer of wisdom that mere logical consistency provides. The second theophany occurs atop Mount Sinai (Life of Moses II 117 - 201 [360 - 392]), and here we find not light but darkness. Thus the Israelites were first led through the desert by a cloudy pillar; and finally they arrived at the mountain of divine knowledge, which was wrapped in darkness. Thus when it comes to a more profound understanding of God, the relevant visual metaphor is darkness, not light. Similarly, the relevant auditory metaphor is silence, not speech (Ecclesiastes VII [732]). At this stage Moses learns a much deeper fact about God--that all the language we use of God is only superficial and that a truer understanding of God will only reveal God's utter incomprehensibility. One who becomes aware of God's complete mysteriousness has, paradoxically, learned more about God than the most articulate theologian.

At this stage there is no longer any reliance on the physical senses; indeed, as has been seen, at this level sight and hearing shut down. Instead, the vision of God is mediated by the so-called "spiritual senses," an idea Gregory's inherits from his theological mentor Origen (Song of Songs I 4, II 9 - 11, III 5). God cannot be perceived with the external senses, but some sort of mystical awareness of God is achievable internally. In this vein it is significant that, when discussing the spiritual senses, Gregory most often appeals, not to the "higher" senses of sight and hearing, but to the more intimate senses of smell, taste, and touch as metaphors by which to describe them (cf. Song of Songs I [780 - 784], III [821 - 828], IV [844]).

The third and final theophany revolves around Moses' vision of God's glory from the cleft in a rock (Life of Moses II 202 - 321 [392 - 429]). Moses, as Gregory interprets him, is one of those who crave ever more intimate communion with God. Earlier he had requested to know God's name; now he asks to behold God's glory. So God directs Moses to the cleft of a rock and walks by, placing a hand over the cleft to obscure Moses' sight; only after God has passed is the hand removed, but by now all Moses can see is God's back. Thus Moses finally realizes that the longing for utter intimacy with God can never be satisfied--faith will never be transformed into understanding (cf. Against Eunomius II [941])--but nevertheless "what Moses yearned for is satisfied by the very things which leave his desire unsatisfied" (Life of Moses II 235 [404]). Because God is an infinite being, the desire to know God is an infinite process; but in Gregory's eyes this really makes it much more satisfying than some static Beatific Vision. The process of becoming ever closer to God does not cease at physical death (which is, after all, just one among many passing events punctuating human existence), but continues forever.

When reflecting on Gregory's theory of knowledge as developed in The Life of Moses, one is struck by his commitment to rationalism--this despite his ambivalence on the value of pagan wisdom. Scripture for him is merely the starting point of the intellectual quest; and, given his reliance on allegory as a tool of exegesis, even that is brought within the ambit of a rational worldview. However, for Gregory the quest does not end with reason; rather, because God is utterly mysterious and infinitely remote, the quest is capped by a mystical ascent that always approaches but never reaches its destination. This intellectual dynamic is paralleled by a moral one, which will be sketched in what follows.

7. Virtue

Gregory's ethical thought explores the implications of the theme of the "dignity of royalty" of the human person, which, as has been seen, derives from the idea that humans, and humans alone, were created in the image of God. This is perhaps the most far-reaching theme of Christian ethics. For it means that because there is a part of the human person that is literally not of this world, human beings are possessed of an intrinsic worth which is unique in creation. This idea obviously imposes certain obligations on us in relation to both ourselves and others. To others we owe mercy (Beatitudes V [1252 - 1253]) and the Christian virtue of agape (Beatitudes VII [1284]). To ourselves we owe the effort to overcome the deficiencies in our likeness to God; for we are unable to contemplate God directly, and morally our free will has been compromised by the passions (pathe). Thus with respect to ourselves we must strive for intellectual and moral perfection (Beatitudes III [1225 - 1228], V [1253 - 1260).

Because he was committed to the idea that humans have a unique value that demands respect, Gregory was an early and vocal opponent of slavery and also of poverty. Against the former Gregory marshals three arguments (Ecclesiastes IV [665]): (1) Only God has the right to enslave humans, and God does not choose to do so; indeed, it was God who gave human beings their free wills. (2) How dare a person take that precious entity--the only part of the created order to have been made in God's image--and enslave it! (3) As humans who were created in the divine image, all people are radically equal; therefore, it is hubristic for some to arrogate to themselves absolute authority over others. Against the latter, he appeals, once again, to the "dignity of royalty" theme--that poverty is inconsistent with the rulership bestowed on humankind at its creation (On Compassion for the Poor [477]). Both slavery and poverty sully the dignity of human beings by degrading them to a station below the purple to which they were rightfully born; and although we may congratulate ourselves on having outlawed slavery, it is important to remember that for Gregory poverty is no different.

Moral progress is defined by two phases. Initially we must pursue the Stoic ideal of apatheia (passionlessness; cf. Diogenes Laertius, Lives VII 117), but in moderation (Beatitudes II [1216]). However, Gregory makes it clear that this moderation is due only to the exigencies of life in the flesh. At some point we must go beyond being satisfied with moderation and strive for a life which, in its breadth, is one of complete, not partial, virtue (Beatitudes IV [1241]), and, in its depth, is a matter of continual, unceasing perfection (Beatitudes IV [1244 - 1245]). The former idea, the unity of the virtues, Gregory derives, once again, from the Stoics (cf. Diogenes Laertius, Lives VII 125); but the latter is entirely his own.

Again, Gregory distinguishes between the Old Law and the New Law, which is built on the Old but goes beyond it (Beatitudes VI [1273 - 1276]). The Old Law deals with externals--works. But the New Law deals, not with works, but with the psychological springs from which works originate. To perfect one's outward behavior is one thing; to purify one's own heart is quite another. Thus, for example, whereas the Old Law prohibited murder, the New Law forbids even anger; and whereas the Old Law prohibited adultery, the New Law forbids even lust. Combining this theme with the one discussed in the last paragraph, one must conclude that Gregory sees moral progress as moving from a state of finite, external virtue to one of infinite, internal progress.

Once again, the similarity to Kant is striking. Like Gregory, Kant distinguishes four kinds of duty--perfect and imperfect duties to ourselves and to others (Metaphysical Principles of Virtue Introduction). More importantly, he distinguishes between duties of right and duties of virtue (Metaphysical Principles of Right Introduction III, Metaphysical Principles of Virtue Introduction VII). And the differences between duties of right and of virtue are similar to the distinctions Gregory draws between moderation and infinite perfection and between the Old and the New Law. Duties of right tend to deal with externals and, as "thou shalt nots," can be completely fulfilled. Duties of virtue, on the other hand, tend to deal with the will and, as "thou shalts," can never be completely fulfilled. In fact, in his famous discussion of the postulate of immortality Kant argues that the process of moral perfection is limitless and that if "ought" implies "can" it must be possible for humans to engage in an unending pursuit of perfection (Critique of Practical Reason Dialectic IV; cf. Metaphysical Principles of Virtue I 22).

8. Conclusion

This paper has tried to make clear what a rich resource of ideas we have in Gregory of Nyssa. What is also of great historical interest is Gregory's pivotal role in the development of Western consciousness. Gregory takes numerous ideas from the Judaeo-Christian, particularly Philonian-Origenist, tradition and from the pagan Middle Platonist and Neoplatonist schools, digests them into a very original synthesis and in expounding that synthesis develops ideas that anticipate later Byzantine thinkers such as the Pseudo-Dionysius and Gregory Palamas. Not only that, but several of Gregory's most important theories bear some resemblance to modern thinkers such as John Locke and Immanuel Kant (though through what channels of transmission, if any, is unclear--perhaps John Scotus Eriugena (c. 810 - c. 877), who quotes him extensively, and the Cambridge Platonists of the seventeenth century). Given all that, and given Gregory's relative absence from most standard treatments of Western thought, I think may be fair to say that Gregory of Nyssa is one of the most under-appreciated figures in Western intellectual history.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Greek Texts

  • Gregor von Nyssa: Aus einem Briefe an Xenodorus. In Analecta Patristica: Texte und Abhandlungen der Griechischen Patristik, edited by Franz Diekamp, pp. 13 - 15. Orientalia Christiana Analecta 177. Rome: Pontificium Institutum Orientalium Studiorum, 1938.
    • This is the source for an important fragment discussing Gregory's concept of "energies."
  • Gregorii Nysseni Opera. Edited by Werner Jaeger, et al. Leiden: Brill, 1960 - 1998.
    • This critical edition of Gregory's works is rapidly replacing the much older Migne edition. However the edition has not yet been completed.
  • Patrologia Graeca, vols. 44 - 46. Edited by J. P. Migne. Paris: Migne, 1857 - 1866.
    • In the above citations I have placed page references to the Migne edition (which is still the only complete edition of Gregory's works) in brackets.

b. Translations

  • From Glory to Glory: Texts from Gregory of Nyssa's Mystical Writings. Edited by Jean Danielou. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1997.Gregory of Nyssa: Homilies on Ecclesiastes. Translated by Stuart G. Hall and Rachel Moriarty. Proceedings of the Seventh International Colloquium on Gregory of Nyssa. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1993.
  • Life of Moses. Translated by Abraham J. Malherbe and Everett Ferguson. Classics of Western Spirituality. New York: Paulist Press, 1978.
  • On the Inscriptions of the Psalms. Translated by Ronald E. Heine. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995.
  • Saint Gregory of Nyssa: Ascetical Works. Translated by Virginia W. Callahan. The Fathers of the Church, vol. 58. Washington: Catholic University Press, 1967.
  • Saint Gregory of Nyssa: Commentary on the Song of Songs. Translated by Casimir McCambley. Archbishop Iakovos Library of Ecclesiastical and Historical Sources, no. 12. Brookline: Hellenic College Press, 1987.
  • Select Writings and Letters of Gregory, Bishop of Nyssa. Translated by William Moore and Henry A. Wilson. A Select Library of Nicene and Post-Nicene Fathers of the Christian Church, 2d series, vol. 5. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1954. Note that Book II of Against Eunomius in this edition is now regarded as Book IV (usually referred to under various titles as a separate work), Books III - XII are now regarded as Sections 1 - 10 of Book III, and the "Answer to Eunomius' Second Book" is now regarded as Book II.
  • St. Gregory of Nyssa: The Soul and the Resurrection. Translated by Catharine P. Roth. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1993.
  • The Lord's Prayer, The Beatitudes. Translated by Hilda C. Graef. Ancient Christian Writers, vol. 18. New York: Newman Press, 1954.

c. Secondary Sources

  • Balas, David L. Metousia Theou: Man's Participation in God's Perfections according to Saint Gregory of Nyssa. Rome: Pontificium Institutum Sancti Anselmi, 1966.Balthasar, Hans Urs von. Presence and Thought: An Essay on the Religious Philosophy of Gregory of Nyssa. San Francisco: Ignatius Press, 1995.
  • Barnes, Michel Rene. The Power of God: Dunamis in Gregory of Nyssa's Trinitarian Theology. Washington: Catholic University Press, 2001.
  • Callahan, J. F. "Greek Philosophy and the Cappadocian Cosmology." Dumbarton Oaks Papers 12 (1958): 30 - 57.
  • Cherniss, Harold Fredrik. The Platonism of Gregory of Nyssa. New York: Lenox Hill Publishers, 1971.
  • Coakley, Sarah, ed. Re-Thinking Gregory of Nyssa. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing, 2003.
  • Harrison, Verna E. F. Grace and Human Freedom According to St. Gregory of Nyssa. Lewiston: Edwin Mellen Press, 1992.
  • Heine, Ronald E. "Gregory of Nyssa's Apology for Allegory." Vigiliae Christianae 38 (1984): 360 - 370.
  • Jaeger, Werner. Two Rediscovered Works of Ancient Christian Literature: Gregory of Nyssa and Macarius. Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1954.
  • Keenan, Mary Emily. "De Professione Christiana and De Perfectione: A Study of the Ascetical Doctrine of Saint Gregory of Nyssa." Dumbarton Oaks Papers 5 (1950): 167 - 207.
  • Ladner, Gerhart D. "The Philosophical Anthropology of Saint Gregory of Nyssa." Dumbarton Oaks Papers 12 (1958): 59 - 94.
  • Lossky, Vladimir. The Vision of God. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1983.
  • Louth, Andrew. The Origins of the Christian Mystical Tradition: From Plato to Denys. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1981.
  • Meredith, Anthony. Gregory of Nyssa. London: Routledge, 1999.
  • Meredith, Anthony. The Cappadocians. Crestwood: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1995.
  • Moutsoulas, Elias D. The Incarnation of the Word and the Theosis of Man According to the Teaching of Gregory of Nyssa. Athens: Elias D. Moutsoulas, 2000.
  • Pelikan, Jaroslav. Christianity and Classical Culture: The Metamorphosis of Natural Theology in the Christian Encounter with Hellenism. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1993.
  • Otis, Brooks. "Cappadocian Thought as a Coherent System." Dumbarton Oaks Papers 12 (1958): 96 - 124.
  • Stramara, Daniel F. "Gregory of Nyssa: An Ardent Abolitionist?" St. Vladimir's Theological Quarterly. 41 (1997): 37 - 69.
  • Weiswurm, Alcuin A. The Nature of Human Knowledge According to Saint Gregory of Nyssa. Washington: Catholic University Press, 1952.

Author Information

Donald L. Ross
Georgetown University

U. S. A.

Jane Addams (1860—1935)

addamsJane Addams was an activist and prolific writer in the American Pragmatist tradition who became a nationally recognized leader of Progressivism in the United States as well as an internationally renowned peace advocate. Addams is primarily acclaimed for founding the Chicago social settlement, Hull-House, which emerged as the flagship of the Settlement Movement. Hull-House provided Addams with a supportive intellectual community and a basis for understanding urban life amidst rapid immigrant influx. Together with other Hull-House residents, Addams undertook a number of local, state, national and ultimately international activist projects including garbage collection, adult education, child labor reform, labor union support, women’s suffrage and peace advocacy among others. Her personal accomplishments are staggering and are recounted in a number of contemporary biographies. Addams helped to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People, the American Civil Liberties Union and the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. In 1931, she was awarded the Nobel Peace Prize.

Addams’ achievements as a social reformer represent a prodigious legacy but she also left a significant intellectual heritage. She authored a dozen books and over 500 articles of original social philosophy as recognized by her contemporaries including John Dewey, William James, and George Herbert Mead. The organizing principle of her social philosophy was progress. To this end, Addams understood democracy as both a form of socially engaged living and as a framework for social morality. Accordingly, authentic social advancement should be democratic or what she termed “lateral progress,” an inclusive advancement not just narrowly applied to the privileged. Addams argued that fostering the moral relations necessary for a robust democracy required community members to engage in “sympathetic knowledge,” an approach to learning about one another for the purpose of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Addams’ writings emphasize direct experience, pluralism and fallibility in the engagement with concrete social issues. Although the works of male philosophers such as Dewey, Peirce, James and Mead dominate the literature of classic American pragmatism, the writings of Jane Addams provide a unique and provocative feminist pragmatist voice.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Social Philosophy
    1. Sympathetic Knowledge
    2. Lateral Progress
    3. Pluralism
    4. Democracy
    5. Fallibilism
  3. Themes
    1. Peace
    2. Education
    3. Women’s Advancement
    4. Economics
  4. Philosophical Legacy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Literature
      1. Books
      2. Selected Articles
      3. Collections
    2. Secondary Literature
    3. Biographies

1. Biography

Laura Jane Addams was born on September 6, 1860 in Cedarville, Illinois, ten months after the publication of Darwin’s Origin of The Species, two months prior to the election of Abraham Lincoln to the presidency of the United States and seven months prior to the secession of the South from the Union. Addams recounts her early life in Twenty Years at Hull-House, the only one of her works to continuously remain in print since it was first published in 1910. As a child she was called “Jennie” but her childhood had a turbulent beginning. When Jennie was two, her mother, Sarah, died whilst giving birth to her ninth child. As a result, Addams formed a significant bond with her father, John, who was a successful mill owner and politician. John Addams corresponded with Lincoln, and Jane Addams associated her father and Lincoln as moral icons and personal inspirations throughout her life. The relationship between John and his daughter was important because it afforded Jane the attention of an educated and worldly adult, an opportunity not experienced by many young women of this era. John Addams remarried but there was always a special bond between Jane and he.

John Addams sent his daughter to college at the Rockford Female Seminary (later Rockford College). Although Addams was always a good student, she blossomed in college and became a widely acknowledged campus leader. Addams learned how valuable a supportive female community could be given women’s exclusion from most activities in the public sphere. She later replicated the woman-centered atmosphere at Hull-House. When Addams graduated from college in 1881, she intended to pursue a medical career, but after a short tine in graduate school, she decided that medicine was not in her future. The death of her father in that same year placed her life in turmoil. Having lost direction in her life, she fell into a decade-long phase of soul searching, combined with sporadic health problems. During this period she undertook several trips to Europe. On her second trip, she encountered the pioneering social settlement, Toynbee Hall in London. Toynbee Hall provided young men an opportunity to work to improve the lives of impoverished Londoners. Soon after this encounter Addams developed a plan to start a social settlement in the United States.

Addams enlisted the help of her friend Ellen Gates Starr in her noble scheme. Starr had briefly attended Rockford College with Addams, so they shared an understanding of the empowerment that a female community could provide to its residents. Addams and Starr open the Hull-House settlement in 1889 in the heart of a run-down neighborhood on the west side of Chicago. They began with few plans, few resources and few residents but with a desire to be good neighbors to the community. Working with the network of women’s organizations in Chicago, the number of Hull-House projects quickly grew, as did their reputation. Women, and to a lesser extent men, came from all over the country to live and work as part of this progressive experiment in communal living combined with social activism. Under Addams’ leadership, Hull-House opened a public bathhouse, undertook a campaign to have the garbage collected, started a kindergarten, developed the first playground in Chicago and responded to a variety of community needs. At first, Addams had rented the entire second floor and the first floor drawing room of the Hull-House building but eventually the settlement complex grew to accommodate one full city block. Addams faced an ongoing challenge to explain the work Hull-House had undertaken. People often felt compelled to give settlement projects the familiar label of charity work, but Addams rebuffed this claim. As she explained in her 1893 article, “The Objective Value of the Social Settlement,” Addams viewed Hull-House residents as engaged in reciprocal knowledge work: the collection, analysis and dissemination of information combined with intelligent action.

Addams was an effective activist and organizer but she was also keenly attuned to social theory. As a child she had read widely, largely influenced by her father who housed the town library in their home. At Rockford, she was exposed to Ancient Greek philosophy as well as the social theories of the Romantics, John Ruskin and Thomas Carlyle. At Hull-House, Addams attracted the attention of John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, each of whom visited and engaged Addams in lively conversations that proved to be mutually influencing. Given this intellectual foundation, Addams used her Hull-House experience as a springboard for developing public philosophy in the American Pragmatist Tradition. In 1899, ten years after founding Hull-House, Addams published, “The Function of the Social Settlement” in which she placed her progressive activities in epistemological terms. Addams viewed issues of knowledge as the most profound contemporary challenge. Social settlements were an active effort to learn about one another across class and cultural divides thus building collective knowledge about the individuals who make up this diverse society. In this manner, Hull-House served as a multi-directional conduit of information about human lives: Addams and her cohorts helped immigrants learn how to navigate the complex American culture while Addams communicated and thematized her experience with immigrants to help white, upper and middle class America understand what it meant to be poor and displaced. Furthermore, Addams viewed this knowledge creation as reciprocal: society benefited from the knowledge that immigrants brought and the immigrants benefited from learning about their new neighbors. Addams was unique in recognizing that immigrants could contribute to American culture.

Addams authored or co-authored a dozen books and over 500 articles after she founded Hull-House. The articles appeared in both scholarly and popular periodicals, establishing Addams as a public philosopher and social leader. Addams was also a much in-demand speaker and she traveled nationally and internationally to make presentations that supported her progressive values. Addams was one of the few women of the era to transgress the private sphere to successfully influence the public sphere. Polls indicate that Addams became one of the most recognized and admired figures in the United States. She was an influential catalyst for change, lending her name and organizing skills to a variety of causes. Addams worked with W.E.B. DuBois in support of a number of African-American endeavors including writing articles for his publication The Crisis and helping to found the National Association for the Advancement of Colored People. She helped start the American Civil Liberties Union and organized the Women’s International League for Peace and Freedom. Her tireless effort in support of peace led to Addams receiving the 1931 Nobel Peace prize. Addams died of cancer on May 21, 1935. The public memorial at Hull-House filled the streets with mourners and eulogies were published in newspapers nationally and internationally.

2. Social Philosophy

There are a number of reasons why Addams was not generally recognized as a philosopher until the late twentieth century which include her gender and her association with social work. Another factor in this lack of recognition is that she was not a systematic philosopher either stylistically or methodologically. Addams’ writing style is not typical of the philosophic tradition in that it lacks a sustained abstract character. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, arguably the most philosophical of Addams’ books, the chapters address charity workers, family relationships, domestic workers, industrial working conditions, educational methods and political reforms. To the trained philosopher, these topics appear far removed from more familiar considerations of epistemology, metaphysics and ethics. However, a careful examination of her work reveals that Addams begins with social phenomena and draws theoretical inference from these experiences. In Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams offers intriguing, even radical, insights into the nature of ethics and epistemology. To read Addams as a philosopher requires setting aside assumptions about beginning from abstract theoretical positions. As a pragmatist, Addams is strictly interested in social philosophy. Everything she writes seeks what James would refer to as the “cash value” of an idea for social growth and improvement. Four interrelated cornerstones of her social philosophy are the concepts of sympathetic knowledge, lateral progress, pluralism and fallibilism.

a. Sympathetic Knowledge

Beginning with her first book, Democracy and Social Ethics and running through all of her works addressing social issues is the notion of sympathetic knowledge. Fundamentally, sympathetic knowledge is the idea that humans can learn about one another in terms that move beyond propositional knowledge, that is rather than merely learning facts, knowledge is gained through openness to disruptive knowledge. Knowledge can be disruptive in the sense that new information can transform one’s perceived experience and understanding. This idea motivated Addams and the residents of Hull-House to undertake the first urban study of racial demographics, which was published as Hull-House Maps and Papers in 1895. Addams integrated epistemological inquiry with ethical analysis such that it was the responsibility of members of a society to know one another better for the purposes of caring and acting on one another’s behalf. Sympathetic knowledge is Addams’ rationale behind social settlements. By providing a physical location where people of different backgrounds could meet, social knowledge is built up reducing the abstraction of distant others transforming them into concrete, known others. Accordingly, Addams suggests that the many social activities sponsored by Hull-House—clubs, dances, performances, athletics—were not frivolous affairs but a means for breaking down barriers between people, thus fostering sympathetic knowledge. In Twenty Years at Hull-House and later in The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams claims that these social activities performed an educative function and that social settlements were in fact thoroughly educative projects. Like Dewey, Addams valued education as the foundation of a healthy democratic society. Like Mead, Addams viewed “play” as an essential aspect of education because of its ability to fire the imagination. Addams takes this notion so far as to argue that play is important for a vibrant democracy because it creates the possibility of empathetic imagination. When one plays, one takes on the roles of others and through fictitious inhabitation of these positions begins to empathize with the plight of others. In this manner, education also contributes to sympathetic knowledge. Similarly, literature and drama can enhance sympathetic knowledge as one empathizes with fictitious characters. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored community theater as well as the reading of novels.

The basis of sympathetic knowledge is experience that is imaginatively extrapolated. When Addams addresses prostitution in A New Conscience and an Ancient Evil, she employs anecdotes from the Hull-House community to allow her audience to understand the struggles of young women in the big cities. In this manner, she is neither strictly deontological nor teleological in her moral approach. Rather than dealing with principles of sexuality, for example, or the consequences of prostitution on society, although both considerations are important, Addams begins by attempting to increase knowledge of marginalized women. Inherent in this approach to human ontology is a belief in the fundamental goodness and relationality of people. Addams believes that if her audience understands what is going on in the lives of others, even if those others are outcasts, then we may begin to care and possibly take positive action on their behalf. Addams’ method of sympathetic knowledge extends to those with whom she disagreed. For example, in Democracy and Social Ethics, Addams describes her failed political battles with local ward alderman, Johnny Powers (who Addams does not name in print). Hull-House sponsored a number of unsuccessful attempts to unseat Powers. Rather than excoriate Powers for his backroom deals and bribery, Addams set out to understand what made such an alderman popular. Through this method of inquiry, Addams, although not altering her denunciation of Powers’ cronyism, began to understand how the people of the ward appreciated an alderman who was visible and connected to their everyday lives. For Addams, sympathetic knowledge, despite its emotive implications, was a rational attempt to understand others. Accordingly, Addams eschewed antagonism. Ad hominem attacks only foster defensive barriers so Addams employed sympathetic knowledge in what she described as a detached manner. Such an approach might seem counter intuitive, but is understandable for a figure like Addams who bridged the reserved nature of the Victorian era and the moral commitment of the Progressive era.

b. Lateral Progress

Given her status as one of the leading figures of the progressive era, it is not surprising that Addams advocated social progress, but she distinguished the particular type of progress she advocated. The industrial revolution had seen many people prosper in the name of economic and technological progress. In addition, Addams had grown up in the post-Civil War era where social progress had been attributed to the newfound rights of African-Americans. Addams, however, viewed such progress to be more abstract than concrete. In the case of economic progress, it was experienced mostly by an elite few with some benefits trickling down to the middle class. From her perspective at Hull-House, she witnessed the inability of immigrants to fully participate in the economy or the political process. Similarly, she saw that although African-Americans ostensibly had legal rights, they often were prevented from actualizing those rights through a combination of laws intended to circumvent equality and racism in social relations. Given these experiences, Addams advocated what she referred to as “lateral progress,” or the idea that for authentic progress to take place, it would have to be experienced in a widespread manner rather than by a privileged few. Furthermore, Addams’ notion of lateral progress was not to be enforced hierarchically from structures of authority. Addams envisioned a progress that was derived from participatory democratic processes.

Addams applied the concept of lateral progress to a number of social issues. When it came to women’s suffrage, for example, Addams did not base her arguments upon principles of equality or fairness. Instead, she argued that such a move represented lateral progress, the inclusion of all—including women—would lead to the betterment of society. Similarly, her support of labor unions was tempered by the notion of lateral progress. Addams did not advocate for collective bargaining merely to benefit those fortunate enough to be in the unions; she viewed labor unions as working toward lateral progress by improving wages, hours and working conditions for all workers.

c. Pluralism

Addams argued for the inclusion of all members of society in the institution, policies and practices that were to lead to social progress. For example, in a 1930 article, “Widening the Circle of Enlightenment” Addams contends that pluralism has an energizing impact on society and should be embraced rather than feared. In this manner, Addams was an early American theorist who saw the value of diversity. Addams suggested that by bringing their cultural heritage to the United States, immigrants kept America from becoming static. Reciprocally, immigrants benefited from engaging in the cultural heritage found in North America. For Addams, social progress demanded that all voices be heard but she believed in the power of collective intelligence to find common cause from that diversity.

Addams’ valorization of cultural diversity was so thoroughgoing that she integrated it into her pacifist arguments. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams contends that cosmopolitan cities are a model for international peace. While not romanticizing the conflicts between groups that occur in the city, Addams draws on numerous experiences of people from different cultural heritages setting aside their differences to develop working relationships and help one another survive the challenges of urban life. Addams believed that if diverse people under the strain of Chicago’s urban blight could find a way to work together, then countries in the international community could also come to some equilibrium without violence.

Addams applied her pluralistic commitment to intellectual understanding. Hull-House welcomed speakers from a variety of political positions, whether the residents agreed with those positions or not. To foster this openness, Addams eschewed ideological ties for herself and for the Hull-House community. In this manner, although she was sympathetic to many of the arguments of socialists, anarchists, feminists and various Christian leaders, she never entirely accepted any ideological position. Demonstrating her pragmatism, she avoided political labels but variously aligned herself when it meant advancing the cause of social progress. On many occasions, Addams and Hull-House were criticized for not clearly associating themselves with an ideological camp.

d. Democracy

Addams maintained a robust definition of democracy that moved far beyond understanding it merely as a political structure. For Addams, democracy represented both a mode of living and a social morality. She viewed democracy as an acknowledgement that the lives of citizens are bound up with one another and this relationship creates a duty to understand the struggles and circumstances of fellow citizens. Reciprocity of social relations is crucial for providing citizens with the empathetic foundation necessary to energize democracy. Social settlements were experiments in the kind of democracy that Addams endeavored to promote: one of active social engagement. Addams’ definition of democracy becomes clearest in Democracy and Social Ethics where she makes two equivalencies clear. One, moral theory in the modern age must emphasize social ethics. Two, for Addams, democracy is social ethics.

Addams metaphorically described democracy as a dynamic organism that must grow with changing times in order to remain vital. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams goes so far as to suggest that it was time that the United States’ political institutions and morality progressed. She argued that America’s founders, whom she admired, developed the Bill of Rights based upon an individual sense of morality appropriate for their era. However, Addams viewed social morality as the appropriate response to the contemporary rise of big cities along with the improvements in technology and transportation that brought so many people together. The time had come to emphasize the social relations necessary for a vibrant democracy under the current historical circumstances. Some commentators describe Addams as advocating a “social democracy,” one that emphasizes a way of being over the political structure. Addams’ valorization of democracy did not entail a static object of affection. She wanted democracy to grow and flourish which required ongoing conversation and change. In this manner, Addams never conflated her love of democracy with unabashed patriotism. Also in Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams develops the notion of “cosmic patriotism,” arguing that one’s commitment to humanity must exceed national borders.

e. Fallibilism

Another aspect of Addams’ work that differentiates it from traditional philosophic literature is its humility. Employing the experimental method of American Pragmatists, Addams described numerous ventures undertaken by the Hull-House community in the name of fostering sympathetic knowledge or lateral progress. However, Addams was not afraid to recount her errors in these efforts. For Addams, mistakes are opportunities for growth and are worth the risk of active engagement. In the process of crossing class and cultural boundaries—moving from the familiar to the unfamiliar—there are bound to be mistakes made, but if they are done in the spirit of care and with humility, then the errors are not insurmountable and have the potential to be great teachers. Time and again, the upper class, college-educated, white women who predominated the Hull-House community demonstrated their lack of cultural sensitivity only to provide Addams with an anecdote for further social analysis and an opportunity to learn from the errors. Mistakes were merely part of the pragmatist cycle of action and reflection.

Twenty Years at Hull-House recounts many of Addams’ mistakes. For example, when Starr and Addams first established the settlement, they furnished Hull-House with the trappings of the high culture with which they were familiar. Addams later regretted this approach and recognized the class alienation that fine furniture, draperies and artwork foster. She later has these items removed for simpler furnishings. In another anecdote from Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams oversees the construction of a coffee house at Hull-House to provide working immigrants with a place to purchase nutritious food without the temptation of alcohol, as was available at local saloons. Despite bringing in modern equipment and using the latest techniques in economical and healthy food production, the coffee house proved unpopular, even with Hull-House residents. Addams came to realize that their paternalism had prevailed, once again alienating their community. Eventually, they made adjustments in the menu to local tastes and the coffee house became another successful part of the Hull-House complex, although more for its contribution to socializing than the cuisine it provided. What is interesting about these anecdotes is that Addams does not attempt to hide or put a positive spin on them. Out of sensitivity for misrepresenting the interests and positions of her neighbors, Addams describes the practice of bringing Hull-House neighbors to her presentations so that she would not be viewed simply as the outside expert attesting to her findings. In this way, mistakes served to improve her practices.

3. Themes

Addams’ pragmatist philosophy integrated experience with theory in an ongoing and dynamic dance that makes it inappropriate to separate her theories from the social issues in which she engaged. This is part of the reason that Addams’ work appears alien to those steeped in the Western tradition of philosophy, which attempts to lay claim to universal truths. Addams makes use of what feminist philosophers have described as “standpoint epistemology,” acknowledging that her philosophy is derived from a particular social, political and historical position. Her theoretical work flowed from working out tangible social issues of her day, and yet many of her themes and conclusions remain relevant for the present.

a. Peace

Perhaps no other issue took more of Addams’ time and attention in the latter part of her public career than did peace. Besides dozens of articles, she authored two books, Newer Ideals of Peace and Peace and Bread in Time of War, she also co-authored Women at The Hague, all books that directly address issues of peace. In addition, many of her other books such as The Long Road of Women’s Memory, The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, and My Friend, Julia Lathrop have at least a chapter dedicated to issues of peace. While Addams avoided ideological positions, she came closest when it came to pacifism. Nevertheless, she never invoked a universal principle such as declaring all war as immoral, however she did contend that violent conflict was regressive, wasteful and provided the possibility of further violence in society.

In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams made it clear that she saw peace as more than the absence of war. For Addams, peace represented an opportunity for social progress because people were capable of working together to achieve social goals. Like many in the late nineteenth century, Addams viewed social evolution as progressing toward greater peaceful relations and social harmony. Collective peace was tied to individual peaceful relations such that communal activism represented peace efforts. For example, helping immigrants thrive in the United States was an act of peace. In this manner, given her commitment to democratic social progress achieved through collective engagement in an effort to foster sympathetic knowledge, Addams extrapolated that war is socially regressive. Armed conflict ends rational and dispassionate conversations impeding the agreement necessary for social growth. War makes opposing human beings into ultimate others—someone so alien that it is possible to kill them—creating the antithesis of sympathetic knowledge.

Addams resisted compartmentalizing her moral philosophy, and she extended this to her ideas about peace. Rather than merely offering a direct normative assessment of militarism, Addams casts a wider net to address variables less causally related to a particular conflict. In “Democracy or Militarism,” written in the context of the Spanish-American War, Addams indicates that society is at a crossroads. According to Addams, to accept militaristic actions as a part of international politics is to normalize brutalization that makes further violence acceptable. To support her claim, she cites instances of increased social violence that can be tied, albeit loosely, to the formal acceptance of war. Furthermore, Addams identifies the gender dimension of increased militarism. In “War Times Changing Women’s Traditions,” Addams resists traditional notions of chivalry and romanticism to claim that the ostensible argument for the violent protection of women can only lead women to a vulnerable position in a society where violence is normalized.

Addams was not merely a social critic. Her social philosophy often included alternative plans of action—not fixed solutions but flexible and revisable outcomes. Addams, like William James, suggests that militarism has been ennobled in cultural traditions and that an ennobling substitute was needed to fire the same kind of dedication. In Newer Ideals of Peace, Addams offers social activism as the cause that should be rallied around. Addams challenges her readers to imagine heroism in the work of social activists to improve urban life.

Her staunch philosophy of pacifism brought Addams a great amount of personal criticism during her public career. Although many of her contemporaries, like Dewey, would support the United States’ entry into World War I, Addams did not. Her popularity suffered greatly and she faced some of her harshest rebukes as national emotions peaked prior to the onset of war. More significantly, World War I signaled a changing tide for progressivism. Political realism came to the fore, and Addams’ ideals of peace suddenly became culturally archaic. The post World War I period saw the number of social settlements dwindle and American Pragmatism experienced an extended hibernation.

b. Education

Addams viewed lifelong education as a critical component of an engaged citizenry in a vibrant democracy. To that end, Hull-House sponsored a myriad of educational projects. Addams strived to improve childhood education by working for legislation to reduce child labor, she sponsored a kindergarten at Hull-House and worked with Dewey and education pioneer Ella Flagg Young on pedagogical techniques centered upon making education more relevant for students. Extant descriptions by visitors to Hull-house describe it as permeated by children furiously involved in a myriad of activities.

In the early twentieth century, adolescence was a largely overlooked period of human development and on the occasions when young adulthood was addressed at all, it was usually conceived of as a problem. Addams, who often directed her philosophical analysis to marginalized sectors of society, took a particular interest in adolescence. In what she described as her favorite book, The Spirit of Youth and the City Streets, Addams offers an extended study of the plight of young people and through her Hull-House experiences explains to her readers the needs and challenges of this age. Accordingly, Hull-House sponsored a number of programs for adolescents including social gatherings, athletics and drama. Hull-House engaged in pioneering programs for young women’s sports and physical activity, defying social norms that claimed that exercise was inappropriate for women.

Addams’ commitment to lifelong education resulted in pioneering work in adult education. Hull-House sponsored college extension courses as well as a variety of educational opportunities for adults in the community including lectures and clubs. For example, The Plato Club offered weekly readings and discussions on philosophy, where Dewey sometimes lectured, and The Working People Social Science Club provided an opportunity for discussions of social and political philosophy. Some commentators have claimed that Hull-House was the birthplace of adult education. In The Second Twenty Years at Hull-House, Addams describes developing particular pedagogical techniques adapted for adult students including the need for a peer-level social atmosphere and the use of news events as an opportunity for learning.

c. Women’s Advancement

Addams eschewed ideological labels including that of feminist, nevertheless she was clearly aligned with the feminist movement. She advocated for women’s suffrage and took a leadership role as the Vice-President of the National American Woman Suffrage Association from 1911-1914. Consistent with her notion of lateral progress, Addams’ support for women’s advancement was framed in terms of social progress rather than principles of equality or merely advocating for an oppressed constituency. Addams contended that women brought an alternative perspective to politics and given her commitment to pluralism, alternative perspectives could only strengthen society. For example, in “If Men Were Seeking The Elective Franchise,” Addams parodies the plight of women by commenting on men’s foibles in a manner that mimicked the way men spoke of the reasons women should not be given elective franchise. She accused men of being quarrelsome as well as exhibiting misplaced values in preferring to spend money on armaments than on domestic welfare. Accordingly, Addams is sometimes accused of being a gender essentialist in the language she employed about the nature of men and women.

Addams undertook numerous projects with the empowerment of women as a goal. Hull-House itself was a unique woman-centered project. There were male residents but it was always clear that the leadership and culture of Hull-House were decidedly female. Hull-House supported immigrant mothers in their roles as primary care givers and even took the radical step of disseminating birth control information. One example of Addams’ concern for women can be seen in the creation of the Jane Club, described inTwenty Years at Hull-House. At a time when collective bargaining did not enjoy the legal protections that it does today, Addams observed that women labor union members were particularly vulnerable when it came to periods of unemployment created by strikes or lockouts. When such actions took place, single women could no longer afford rent money. This vulnerability reduced the power of the bargaining unit. Working with women labor leaders such as Mary Kenney, Addams established a workingwoman’s cooperative named the Jane Club. This cooperative ensured that all members’ rent was paid in the event of labor interruptions. Addams eventually secured funding to build housing for the Jane Club but it operated as an independent entity.

Given their commitments to pluralism, classical American philosophers have been generally more sympathetic to the plight of women than many other genres of philosophers, but Addams further sensitized their thought. Contemporary philosopher Charlene Haddock Seigfried coined the term “pragmatist feminism” to describe the fruitful intersection of American philosophy and feminist theory. Seigfried’s quintessential example of a pragmatist feminist was Jane Addams.

d. Economics

Although Addams did not write a book-length work on economics, comment on economic issues permeates her writings. Addams had much in common with socialist analysis, which was particularly popular in this rocky period of American economics. She knew and supported Eugene Debs, and engaged a number of socialist intellectuals in discussions. Given her pursuit of lateral progress, her affinity for socialism is understandable, but Addams’ aversion to antagonism did not allow her to accept the social upheaval espoused in much of the socialist rhetoric. Addams’ support of labor unions exemplified her socialistic leanings. In the formative years of labor organizing, there was a widespread belief that collective bargaining was a mediating step toward a social transformation where eventually greater control of the means of production would be gained by laborers. Addams viewed the amelioration of class differences as representing social progress and therefore supported unionization.

As a result of the Pullman Strike of 1894, Addams became involved in issues of union management relations. Although it was only five years after the opening of Hull-House, Addams had already garnered a public reputation for skilled negotiating and was enlisted to engage in mediation between railroad car workers and George Pullman, the staunch patriarch of the Pullman Palace Car Company and one of the richest men in America. Addams ultimately played a negligible role in the strike because Pullman refused to meet with her. The labor negotiation foundered and the strike ended quickly and painfully for the workers. Addams’ most important contribution was in constructing the legacy of the Pullman strike. Addams penned an eloquent and reflective account of the strike, “A Modern Lear,” in which she compared George Pullman to Shakespeare’s tragic figure, King Lear. It took nearly twenty years for “A Modern Lear” to be printed, as publishers shunned Addams’ critical analysis. Utilizing a process of sympathetic knowledge, Addams does not describe clear-cut heroes and villains in the Pullman strike, but characterizes Pullman as disconnected from his workers, much like King Lear was alienated from his daughter. For Addams, this illustrated the danger of capitalism, that economic barriers isolated people from one another. In a philosophy advocating an engaged society, such barriers retarded progress.

4. Philosophical Legacy

Although Addams has not always been included in the canon of classical American philosophy, her contemporaries, including John Dewey, William James and George Herbert Mead, publicly acknowledged Addams’ influence on their thinking. Therefore, in addition to her own corpus of work, Addams’ intellectual legacy can be found in their philosophy. Nevertheless, for much of the twentieth century, Addams was considered unoriginal and her writing was thought to be derivative of other thinkers. In the 1990’s, a renewed interest in Addams’ theoretical work developed from the feminist practice of revisiting historical boundaries that traditionally limited philosophical qualification. At the turn of the twenty-first century, Addams’ major works have come back in to print and a number of intellectual biographies have reconsidered Addams’ intellectual legacy.

In many ways, Addams took American pragmatism to a logical conclusion: social action. Pragmatists emphasize the dynamic relationship of experience and theory in the service of social advancement. Dewey, James and Mead engaged in social projects from university settings. Addams, who never had an official university appointment, although she did teach occasionally at the University of Chicago, took pragmatist theory out into society and applied it to her projects. However, in the process, she never stopped writing and thematizing her experiences, thus revising and reconsidering her theories. In this manner Addams provides one model of what it is to be a public philosopher.

5. References and Further Reading

a Primary Literature

i. Books

  • Addams, Jane. Democracy and Social Ethics. 1902. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Addams’ most recognizable philosophical work. Of particular importance is the Introduction where she sets forth her concept of sympathetic knowledge.
  • Addams, Jane. Newer Ideals of Peace, New York: Macmillan, 1906. Addams extends the concept of peace to more than the absence of war.
  • Addams, Jane. The Spirit of Youth and the City Streets. 1909. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1972. Addams breaks new ground by addressing the overlooked age of adolescence and describes youth in positive terms rather than the negative terms typical of the era.
  • Addams, Jane. Twenty Years at Hull House. 1910. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1990. Best work to start a study of Addams. Opening chapters are autobiographical and then the book addresses the first two decades of the Hull-House community.
  • Addams, Jane. A New Conscience and an Ancient Evil. 1912. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Addams addresses prostitution using a pragmatist approach that incorporates an analysis of many variables.
  • Addams, Jane. The Long Road of Woman’s Memory. 1916. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Once again focusing upon a marginalized social group, Addams explores the depth of the memories of elderly immigrant women. Includes the intriguing story of the Devil Baby.
  • Addams, Jane. Peace and Bread in Time of War. 1922. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2002. Written after World War I, this work is less optimistic than Newer Ideal of Peace but addresses issues of patriotism and dissent in time of war.
  • Addams, Jane. Second Twenty Years at Hull House. New York: Macmillan, 1930. Addams addresses a variety of topics related to projects at Hull-House.
  • Addams, Jane. The Excellent Becomes the Permanent. New York: Macmillan, 1932. A unique text where Addams eulogizes twelve people including herself. Addams concludes by addressing issues of art, imagination, and memory.
  • Addams, Jane. My Friend, Julia Lathrop. 1935. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004. Her last book-length work, Addams provides a biography of long time Hull-House resident, Julia Lathrop who went on to be the first woman head of a Federal agency (The Women’s Bureau). Although a biography of someone else, this work reveals a great deal about Addams’ values and philosophy.
  • Addams, Jane, Emily G. Balch and Alice Hamilton. Women at The Hague: The International Congress Of Women And Its Results.1915. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2003. Addams authors two chapters of this intriguing historical account of women organizing to prevent war and offer a means for lasting world peace.
  • Residents of Hull-House. Hull-House Maps and Papers. 1895. New York: Arno Press, Inc., 1970. Groundbreaking study of urban life and demographics in Chicago, which had witnessed an unprecedented influx of migrants from Western and Eastern Europe.

ii. Selected Articles

  • Addams, Jane. “Democracy or Militarism.” 1899. Central Anti-Imperialist League of Chicago, Liberty Tract I.
  • Addams, Jane. “A Function of the Social Settlement.” 1899. Reprinted in Christopher Lasch, Ed. The Social Thought of Jane Addams. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company, Inc., 1965.
  • Addams, Jane. “If Men Were Seeking The Elective Franchise.” 1913. Reprinted in Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “A Modern Lear.” 1912. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “The Objective Value of the Social Settlement.” 1893. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “The Subjective Necessity for Social Settlements.” 1893. Reprinted in, Jean Bethke Elshtain, Ed. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Addams, Jane. “War Times Changing Women’s Traditions.” 1916. Reprinted in Jane Addams on Peace, War, and International Understanding 1899-1932, ed., Allen F. Davis (New York: Garland Publishing, 1976), 135.
  • Addams, Jane. “Widening the Circle of Enlightenment.” 1930. Journal of Adult Education II, no. 3 (June).

iii. Collections

  • Bryan, Mary Lynn McCree, Barbara Bair, and Maree De Angury. Eds., The Selected Papers of Jane Addams Volume 1: Preparing to Lead, 1860-1881. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2003.
  • Condliffe Lagemann, Ellen. Ed., Jane Addams On Education. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Publishers, 1994.
  • Cooper Johnson, Emily. Ed., Jane Addams: A Centennial Reader. New York: Macmillan, 1960.
  • Davis, Allen F. Ed., Jane Addams on Peace, War, and International Understanding. New York: Garland Publishing, Inc., 1976.
  • Elshtain, Jean Bethke. Ed., The Jane Addams Reader. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Lasch, Christopher. Ed., The Social Thought of Jane Addams. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company Inc., 1965.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Deegan, Mary Jo. Jane Addams and the Men of the Chicago School, 1892-1918. New Brunswick, NJ: Transaction Books, 1988. Through numerous articles and books, Deegan has spearheaded an effort to have Addams recognized as one of the most important American sociologists.
  • Fischer, Marilyn. On Addams. Wadsworth, 2004. The most concise review of Addams’ philosophy. A handy companion volume to Addams’ writings.
  • Hamington, Maurice. Embodied Care: Jane Addams, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Feminist Ethics. Urbana, Il: University of Illinois Press, 2004. Addams’ work conceived as contributing to feminist care ethics.
  • Seigfried, Charlene Haddock, Pragmatism and Feminism: Reweaving the Social Fabric. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996. Seigfried suggests that pragmatism and feminism have much in common and can benefit from further integration. Addams exemplifies a pragmatist feminist position.

c. Biographies

  • Brown, Victoria Bissell. The Education of Jane Addams. Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press, 2004.
  • Davis, Allen F. American Heroine: The Life and Legend of Jane Addams. London: Oxford, 1973.
  • Diliberto, Gioia. A Useful Woman: The Early Life of Jane Addams. New York: Scribner, 1999.
  • Elshtain, Jean Bethke. Jane Addams and the Dream of American Democracy. New York: Basic Books, 2002.
  • Farrell, John C. Beloved Lady: A History of Jane Addams’ Ideas on Reform and Peace. Baltimore: The John Hopkins Press, 1967.
  • Joslin, Katherine, Jane Addams: A Writer’s Life. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2004.
  • Knight, Louise, Citizen: Jane Addams and the Struggle for Democracy. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2005.
  • Linn, James Weber. Jane Addams: A Biography. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 2000.

Author Information

Maurice Hamington
Lane Community College
U. S. A.

John Stuart Mill (1806—1873)

millJohn Stuart Mill (1806-1873) profoundly influenced the shape of nineteenth century British thought and political discourse. His substantial corpus of works includes texts in logic, epistemology, economics, social and political philosophy, ethics, metaphysics, religion, and current affairs. Among his most well-known and significant are A System of Logic, Principles of Political Economy, On Liberty, Utilitarianism, The Subjection of Women, Three Essays on Religion, and his Autobiography.Mill’s education at the hands of his imposing father, James Mill, fostered both intellectual development (Greek at the age of three, Latin at eight) and a propensity towards reform. James Mill and Jeremy Bentham led the “Philosophic Radicals,” who advocated for rationalization of the law and legal institutions, universal male suffrage, the use of economic theory in political decision-making, and a politics oriented by human happiness rather than natural rights or conservatism. In his twenties, the younger Mill felt the influence of historicism, French social thought, and Romanticism, in the form of thinkers like Coleridge, the St. Simonians, Thomas Carlyle, Goethe, and Wordsworth. This led him to begin searching for a new philosophic radicalism that would be more sensitive to the limits on reform imposed by culture and history and would emphasize the cultivation of our humanity, including the cultivation of dispositions of feeling and imagination (something he thought had been lacking in his own education).

None of Mill’s major writings remain independent of his moral, political, and social agenda. Even the most abstract works, such as the System of Logic and his Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, serve polemical purposes in the fight against the German, or a priori, school otherwise called “intuitionism.” On Mill’s view, intuitionism needed to be defeated in the realms of logic, mathematics, and philosophy of mind if its pernicious effects in social and political discourse were to be mitigated.

In his writings, Mill argues for a number of controversial principles. He defends radical empiricism in logic and mathematics, suggesting that basic principles of logic and mathematics are generalizations from experience rather than known a priori. The principle of utility—that “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness”—was the centerpiece of his ethical philosophy. On Liberty puts forward the “harm principle” that “the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others.” In The Subjection of Women, he compares the legal status of women to the status of slaves and argues for equality in marriage and under the law.

This article provides an overview of Mill’s life and major works, focusing on his key arguments and their relevant historical contexts.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Works
    1. A System of Logic
      1. Names, Propositions, and the Principles of Logic and Mathematics
      2. Other Topics of Interest
    2. An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy
    3. Psychological Writings
    4. Utilitarianism
      1. History of the Principle of Utility
      2. Basic Argument
    5. On Liberty
    6. The Subjection of Women and Other Social and Political Writings
    7. Principles of Political Economy
    8. Essays on Religion
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Writing of John Stuart Mill a few days after Mill’s death, Henry Sidgwick claimed, “I should say that from about 1860-65 or thereabouts he ruled England in the region of thought as very few men ever did: I do not expect to see anything like it again.” (Collini 1991, 178). Mill established this rule over English thought through his writings in logic, epistemology, economics, social and political philosophy, ethics, metaphysics, religion, and current affairs. One can say with relative security, looking at the breadth and complexity of his work, that Mill was the greatest nineteenth century British philosopher.

This rule did not come about accidentally. It had been planned by his father James Mill from the younger Mill’s birth on May 20, 1806. The elder Mill was a towering figure for his eldest child, and Mill’s story must be told through his father’s. James Mill was born in Scotland in 1773 to a family of modest means. Through the patronage of Sir John and Lady Jane Stuart, he was able to attend the University of Edinburgh, which at the time was one of the finest universities in Europe. He trained for the Presbyterian ministry under the auspices of admired teachers like Dugald Stewart, who was an effective popularizer of Thomas Reid’s philosophy.

After a brief and generally unsuccessful stint as a minister, James Mill moved to London, where he began his career in letters. This was a difficult path for a man of very modest resources to take; he and his wife Harriet (married 1805) lived without financial security for well over a decade. It was only with the publication of his The History of British India in 1818—a work that took twelve years to write—that Mill was able to land a stable, well paying job at the East India Company that enabled him to support his large family (ultimately consisting of his wife and nine children).

Throughout the years of relative poverty, James Mill received assistance from friends including the great legal theorist and utilitarian reformer Jeremy Bentham, whom he met in 1808. The two men helped lead the movement of “Philosophic Radicals” that gave intellectual heft to the British Radical party of the early to mid-nineteenth century. Among their colleagues were David Ricardo, George Grote, Sir William Molesworth, John Austin, and Francis Place.

This philosophically inspired radicalism of the early nineteenth century positioned itself against the Whigs and Tories. The Radicals advocated for legal and political reform, universal male suffrage, the use of economic theory (especially Ricardo’s) in political decision-making, and a politics oriented by human happiness rather than by conservatism or by natural rights (which Bentham famously derided as “nonsense upon stilts”). Moreover, one aspect of their political temperament that distinguished them from Whigs and Tories was their rationalism—their willingness to recommend re-structuring social and political institutions under the explicit guidance of principles of reason (e.g. the principle of utility).

With Bentham’s financial support, the Radicals founded the Westminster Review (1824) to counter the Whig Edinburgh Review (1802) and the Tory Quarterly Review (1809). While Whig intellectuals and Radicals tended to align with each other on economic issues, both tending towards pro-urban, pro-industrial, laissez-faire policies, Tory intellectuals focused on defending traditional British social structures and ways of life associated with aristocratic agrarianism. These alliances can be seen in disputes over the Tory-supported Corn Laws, legislation meant to protect domestic agriculture by taxing imported grains.

Though Whigs and Radicals were often allied (eventually forming the Liberal party in the 1840s), some of the most acrimonious political and intellectual rows of the period were over their differences (for example, Macaulay’s famous public disputes with James Mill over political theorizing). James Mill saw the Whigs as too imbued with aristocratic interests to be a true organ of democratic reform. Only the Radicals could properly advocate for the middle and working classes. Moreover, unlike the Radicals, who possessed a systematic politics guided by the principle of utility (the principle that set the promotion of aggregate happiness as the standard for legislation and action), the Whigs lacked a systematic politics. The Whigs depended instead on a loose empiricism, which the senior Mill took as an invitation to complacency. Whigs, alternatively, took exception to the rationalistic tenor of the Radicals’ politics, seeing in it a dangerous psychological and historical naiveté. They also reacted to the extremity of the Radicals’ reformist temperaments, which revealed hostility to the Anglican church and to religion more generally.

The younger Mill was seen as the crown prince of the Philosophic Radical movement and his famous education reflected the hopes of his father and Bentham. Under the dominating gaze of his father, he was taught Greek beginning at age three and Latin at eight. He read histories, many of the Greek and Roman classics, and Newton by eleven. He studied logic and math, moving to political economy and legal philosophy in his early teens, and then went on to metaphysics. His training facilitated active command of the material through the requirement that he teach his younger siblings and through evening walks with his father when the precocious pupil would have to tell his father what he had learned that day. His year in France in 1820 led to a fluency in French and initiated his life-long interest in French thought and politics. As he matured, his father and Bentham both employed him as an editor. In addition, he founded a number of intellectual societies and study groups and began to contribute to periodicals, including the Westminster Review.

The stress of his education and of his youthful activity combined with other factors to lead to what he later termed, in his Autobiography, his “mental crisis” of 1826. There have been a wide variety of attempts to explain what led to this crisis—most of which center around his relation to his demanding father—but what matters most about the crisis is that it represents the beginning of Mill’s struggle to revise his father’s and Bentham’s thought, which he grew to think of as limited in a number of ways. Mill claims that he began to come out of his depression with the help of poetry (specifically Wordsworth). This contributed to his sense that while his education had fostered his analytic abilities, it had left his capacity for feeling underdeveloped. This realization made him re-think the attachment to the radical, rationalistic strands of Enlightenment thought that his education was meant to promote.

In response to this crisis, Mill began exploring Romanticism and a variety of other European intellectual movements that rejected secular, naturalistic, worldly conceptions of human nature. He also became interested in criticisms of urbanization and industrialization. These explorations were furthered by the writings of (and frequent correspondence with) thinkers from a wide sampling of intellectual traditions, including Thomas Carlyle, Auguste Comte, Alexis de Tocqueville, John Ruskin, M. Gustave d’Eichtal (and other St. Simonians), Herbert Spencer, Frederick Maurice, and John Sterling.

The attempt to rectify the perceived deficiencies of the Philosophic Radicals through engagement with other styles of thought began with Mill’s editing of a new journal, the London Review, founded by the two Mills and Charles Molesworth. Molesworth quickly bought out the old Westminster Review in 1834, to leave the new London and Westminster Review as the unopposed voice of the radicals. With James Mill’s death in 1836 and Bentham’s 1832 demise, Mill had more intellectual freedom. He used that freedom to forge a new “philosophic radicalism” that incorporated the insights of thinkers like Coleridge and Thomas Carlyle. (Collected Works [CW], I.209). One of his principal goals was “to shew that there was a Radical philosophy, better and more complete than Bentham’s, while recognizing and incorporating all of Bentham’s which is permanently valuable.” (CW, I.221).

This project is perhaps best indicated by Mill’s well-known essays of 1838 and 1840 on Bentham and Coleridge, which were published in the London and Westminster Review. Mill suggested that Bentham and Coleridge were “the two great seminal minds of England in their age” and used each essay to show their strengths and weaknesses, implying that a more complete philosophical position remained open for articulation. Mill would spend his career attempting to carry that out.

Harriet Taylor, friend, advisor, and eventual wife, helped him with this project. He met Taylor in 1830 and she was to join James Mill as one of the two most important people in Mill’s life. Unfortunately for Mill, Taylor was married. After two decades of an intense and somewhat scandalous platonic relationship, they were married in 1851 after her husband’s death. Her death in 1858 left him inconsolable.

There has been substantial debate about the nature and extent of Harriet Taylor’s influence on Mill. Beyond question is that Mill found in her a partner, friend, critic, and someone who encouraged him. Mill was probably most swayed by her in the realms of political, ethical, and social thought, but less so in the areas of logic and political economy (with the possible exception of his views on socialism).

Mill’s day-to-day existence was dominated by his work at the East India Company, though his job required little time, paid him well, and left him ample opportunity for writing. He began there in 1826, working under his father, and by his retirement in 1857, he held the same position as his father, chief examiner, which put him in charge of the memoranda guiding the company’s policies in India.

On his retirement and after the death of his wife, Mill was recruited to stand for a Parliamentary seat. Though he was not particularly effective during his one term as an MP, he participated in three dramatic events. (Capaldi 2004, 326-7). First, Mill attempted to amend the 1867 Reform Bill to substitute “person” for “man” so that the franchise would be extended to women. Though the effort failed, it generated momentum for women’s suffrage. Second, he headed the Jamaica Committee, which pushed (unsuccessfully) for the prosecution of Governor Eyre of Jamaica, who had imposed brutal martial law after an uprising by blacks. Third, Mill used his influence with the leaders of the laboring classes to defuse a potentially dangerous confrontation between government troops and workers who were protesting the defeat of the 1866 Reform Bill.

After his term in Parliament ended and he was not re-elected, Mill began spending more time in France, writing, walking, and living with his wife’s daughter, Helen Taylor. It was to her that he uttered his last words in 1873, “You know that I have done my work.” He was buried next to his wife, Harriet.

Though Mill’s influence has waxed and waned since his death, his writings in ethics and social and political philosophy continue to be read most often. Many of his texts—particularly On Liberty, Utilitarianism, The Subjection of Women, and his Autobiography—continue to be reprinted and taught in universities throughout the world.

2. Works

Mill wrote on a startling number of topics. All his major texts, however, play a role in defending his new philosophic radicalism and the intellectual, moral, political, and social agendas associated with it.

a. A System of Logic

Though Mill’s biography reveals his openness to intellectual exploration, his most basic philosophical commitment—to naturalism—never seriously wavers. He is committed to the idea that our best methods of explaining the world are those employed by the natural sciences. Anything that we can know about human minds and wills comes from treating them as part of the causal order investigated by the sciences, rather than as special entities that lie outside it.

By taking the methods of the natural sciences as the only route to knowledge about the world, Mill sees himself as rejecting the “German, or a priori view of human knowledge,” (CW, I.233) or, as he also calls it, “intuitionism,” which was espoused in different ways by Kant, Reid, and their followers in Britain (e.g. Whewell and Hamilton). Though there are many differences among intuitionist thinkers, one “grand doctrine” that Mill suggests they all affirm is the view that “the constitution of the mind is the key to the constitution of external nature—that the laws of the human intellect have a necessary correspondence with the objective laws of the universe, such that these may be inferred from those.” (CW, XI.343). The intuitionist doctrine conceives of nature as being largely or wholly constituted by the mind rather than more or less imperfectly observed by it. One of the great dangers presented by this doctrine, from the perspective of Mill’s a posteriori school, is that it supports the belief that one can know universal truths about the world through evidence (including intuitions or Kantian categories of the understanding) provided by the mind alone rather than by nature. If the mind constitutes the world that we experience, then we can understand the world by understanding the mind. It was this freedom from appeal to nature and the lack of independent (i.e. empirical) checks to the knowledge claims associated with it that Mill found so disturbing.

For Mill, the problems with intuitionism extend far beyond the metaphysical and epistemological to the moral and political. As Mill says in his Autobiography when discussing his important treatise of 1843, A System of Logic:

The notion that truths external to the mind may be known by intuition or consciousness, independently of observation and experience, is, I am persuaded, in these times, the great intellectual support of false doctrines and bad institutions. By the aid of this theory, every inveterate belief and every intense feeling, of which the origin is not remembered, is enabled to dispense with the obligation of justifying itself by reason, and is erected into its own all-sufficient voucher and justification. There never was such an instrument devised for consecrating all deep-seated prejudices. And the chief strength of this false philosophy in morals, politics, and religion, lies in the appeal which it is accustomed to make to the evidence of mathematics and of the cognate branches of physical science. To expel it from these, is to drive it from its stronghold. (CW, I.233)

This charge against intuitionism, that it frees one from the obligation of justifying one’s beliefs, has strong roots in philosophic radicalism. We find Bentham, in his 1789 An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, attacking non-utilitarian moral systems for just this reason: “They consist all of them in so many contrivances for avoiding the obligation of appealing to any external standard, and for prevailing upon the reader to accept of the author’s sentiment or opinion as a reason and that a sufficient one for itself.” (IPML, II.14). Mill thus saw his own commitment to the naturalism and empiricism of the “a posteriori school” of thought as part of a broader social and political agenda that advocated for reform and also undercut traditional foundations of conservatism.

Intuitionism, however, is often taken to be on much firmer ground than empiricism when it comes to accounting for our knowledge of mathematics and logic. This is especially true if one rejects the idea, found in people like Hobbes and Hume, that mathematical propositions like 2 + 3 = 5 are true merely because of the meaning of the constituents of the proposition, or, as Hume puts it, because of the proposition’s “relations of ideas.” Mill agrees with those (including Kant) who maintain that logical and mathematical truths are not merely linguistic—that they contain substantive, non-linguistic information. But this leaves Mill with the problem of accounting for the apparent necessity of such truths—a necessity which seems to rule out their origin in experience. To successfully attack intuitionism in “its stronghold,” the System of Logic needs to provide alternative grounds for basic principles of logic and mathematics (e.g. the principle of non-contradiction). In particular, Mill needs to show how “that peculiar character of what are called necessary truths” may be explained from experience and association alone.

The object of logic “is to ascertain how we come by that portion of our knowledge (much the greatest portion) which is not intuitive: and by what criterion we can, in matters not self-evident, distinguish between things proved and things not proved, between what is worthy and what is unworthy of belief.” (A System of Logic [System], I.i.1). It should be noted that logic goes beyond formal logic for Mill and into the conditions of truth more generally.

The text has the following basic structure. Book I addresses names and propositions. Books II and III examine deduction and induction, respectively. Book IV discusses a variety of operations of the mind, including observation, abstraction and naming, which are presupposed in all induction or instrumental to more complicated forms of induction. Book V reveals fallacies of reasoning. Finally, in Book VI, Mill treats the “moral sciences” and argues for the fundamental similarity of the methods of the natural and human sciences. In fact, the human sciences can be understood as themselves natural sciences with human objects of study.

i. Names, Propositions, and the Principles of Logic and Mathematics

Mill’s argument that the principles of mathematics and logic are justified by appeal to experience depends upon his distinction between verbal and real propositions, that is, between propositions that do not convey new information to the person who understands the meaning of the proposition’s terms and those propositions that do convey new information. The point of the distinction between verbal and real propositions is, first, to stress that all real propositions are a posteriori. Second, the distinction emphasizes that verbal propositions are empty of content; they tell us about language (i.e. what words mean) rather than about the world. In Kantian terms, Mill wants to deny the possibility of synthetic a priori propositions, while contending that we can still make sense of our knowledge of subjects like logic and mathematics.

This distinction between verbal and real propositions depends, in turn, upon Mill’s analysis of the meaning of propositions, i.e. how the meanings of constituents of propositions determine the meaning of the whole. A proposition, in which something is affirmed or denied of something, is formed by putting together two “names” or terms (subject and predicate) and a copula. The subject is the name “denoting the person or thing which something is affirmed or denied of.” (System, I.i.2). The predicate is “the name denoting that which is affirmed or denied.” The copula is “the sign denoting that there is an affirmation or denial,” which thereby enables “the hearer or reader to distinguish a proposition from any other kind of discourse.” In the proposition ‘gold is yellow’ for example, the copula ‘is’ shows that the quality yellow is being affirmed of the substance gold.

Mill divides names into general and singular names. All names, except proper names (e.g. Ringo, Buckley, etc) and names that signify an attribute only (e.g. whiteness, length), have a connotation and a denotation. That is, they both connote or imply some attribute(s) and denote or pick out individuals that fall under that description. The general name “man,” for example, denotes Socrates, Picasso, Plutarch and an indefinite number of other individuals, and it does so because they all share some attribute(s) (e.g. rational animal, featherless biped, etc.) connoted by man. The name “white” denotes all white things and implies or connotes the attribute whiteness. The word “whiteness,” by contrast, denotes or signifies an attribute but does not connote an attribute. Instead, it operates like a proper name in that its meaning derives entirely from what it denotes.

The meaning of a typical proposition is that the thing(s) denoted by the subject has the attribute(s) connoted by the predicate. In sentences like “Eleanor is tired” and “All men are mortal,” though the subjects pick out their objects differently (through a proper name and through an attribute, respectively), Mill’s basic story about the meaning of propositions holds.

Things become much more difficult with identity statements like “Hesperus is Phosphorus.” In this case, we have two proper names that pick out the same object (the planet Venus). Under Mill’s view, these proper names should have the same meaning because they denote the same object. But this appears untenable because the statement seems informative. It doesn’t seem plausible that the proposition merely states that an object is identical with itself, which would be the proposition’s meaning if Mill’s views on the meaning of proper names were correct. (See Frege and Russell’s attack on Mill’s account of the meaning of proper names; but see Kripke’s sophisticate defense of Mill on this in Naming and Necessity).

This discussion of the nature of names or terms enables us to understand Mill’s treatment of verbal and real propositions. Verbal propositions assert something about the meaning of names rather than about matters of fact. This means that, “(s)ince names and their signification are entirely arbitrary, such propositions are not, strictly speaking, susceptible of truth or falsity, but only of conformity or disconformity to usage or convention.” (System, This kind of proposition simply “asserts of a thing under a particular name, only what is asserted of it in the fact of calling it by that name; and which, therefore, either gives no information, or gives it respecting the name, not the thing.” ( As such, verbal propositions are empty of content and they are the only things we know a priori, independently of checking the correspondence of the proposition to the world.

Real propositions, in contrast, “predicate of a thing some fact not involved in the signification of the name by which the proposition speaks of it; some attribute not connoted by that name.” ( Such propositions convey information that is not already included in the names or terms employed, and their truth or falsity depends on whether or not they correspond to relevant features of the world. Thus, “George is on the soccer team” predicates something of the subject George that is not included in its meaning (in this case, the denotation of the individual person) and its being true or not depends upon whether George is, in fact, on the team.

Mill’s great contention in the System of Logic is that logic and mathematics contain real, rather than merely verbal, propositions. He claims, for example, that the law of contradiction (i.e. the same proposition cannot at the same time be false and true) and the law of excluded middle (i.e. either a proposition is true or it is false) are both real propositions. They are, like the axioms of geometry, experimental truths, not truths known a priori. They represent generalizations or inductions from observation—very well-justified inductions, to be sure, but inductions nonetheless. This leads Mill to say that the necessity typically ascribed to the truths of mathematics and logic by his intuitionist opponents is an illusion, thereby undermining intuitionist argumentative fortifications at their strongest point.

A System of Logic thus represents the most thorough attempt to argue for empiricism in epistemology, logic, and mathematics before the twentieth century (for the best discussion of this point, see Skorupski 1989). Though revolutionary advances in logic and philosophy of language in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries have rendered many of Mill’s technical points about semantics and logic obsolete, the basic philosophical vision that Mill defends is very much a live option (see, for example, the work of Quine).

ii. Other Topics of Interest

There are some other topics covered in the System of Logic that are of interest. First is Mill’s treatment of deduction (in the form of the syllogism). His discussion is driven by one basic concern: Why wouldn’t a deduction simply tell us what we already know? How can it be informative? Mill discounts two common views about the syllogism, namely, that it is useless (because it tells us what we already know) and that it is the correct analysis of what the mind actually does when it discovers truths. To understand why Mill discounts these ways of thinking about deduction, we need to understand his views on inference.

The key point here is that all inference is from particular to particular. When we infer that the Duke of Wellington is mortal from “All men are mortal,” what we are really doing is inferring the Duke’s mortality from the mortality of the individual people with whose mortality we are familiar. What the mind does in making a deductive inference is not to move from a universal truth to a particular one. Rather, it moves from truths about a number of particulars to a smaller number (or one). The general statement that “All men are mortal” only allows us to more easily register what we know—it reflects neither the true inference being made nor the warrant or evidence we have for making the inference. Though general propositions are not necessary for reasoning, they are heuristically useful (as are the syllogisms that employ them). They aid us in memory and comprehension.

Mill’s famous treatment of induction reveals the a posteriori grounds for belief. He focuses on four different methods of experimental inquiry that attempt to single out from the circumstances that precede or follow a phenomenon the ones that are linked to the phenomenon by an invariable law. (System, III.viii.1). That is, we test to see if a purported causal connection exists by observing the relevant phenomena under an assortment of situations. If we wish, for example, to know whether a virus causes a disease, how can we prove it? What counts as good evidence for such a belief? The four methods of induction or experimental inquiry—the methods of agreement, of difference, of residues, and of concomitant variation—provide answers to these questions by showing what we need to demonstrate in order to claim that a causal law holds. Can we show, using the method of difference, that when the virus is not present the disease is also absent? If so, then we have some grounds for believing that the virus causes the disease.

Another issue addressed in A System of Logic that is of abiding interest is Mill’s handling of free will. Mill’s commitment to naturalism includes treating the human will as a potential object of scientific study: “Our will causes our bodily actions in the same sense, and in no other, in which cold causes ice, or a spark causes an explosion of gunpowder. The volition, a state of our mind, is the antecedent; the motion of our limbs in conformity to the volition, is the consequent.” (System, III.v.11). The questions that readily arise are how, under this view, can one take the will to be free and how can we preserve responsibility and feelings of choice?

In his Autobiography, Mill recounts his own youthful, melancholy acceptance of the doctrine of “Philosophical Necessity” (advocated by, among others, Robert Owen and his followers): “I felt as if I was scientifically proved to be the helpless slave of antecedent circumstances; as if my character and that of all others had been formed for us by agencies beyond our control, and was wholly out of our own power.” (CW, I.175-7). But it is precisely the idea that our character is formed for us, not by us, that Mill thinks is a “grand error.” (System, VI.ii.3). We have the power to alter our own character. Though our own character is formed by circumstances, among those circumstances are our own desires. We cannot directly will our characters to be one way rather than another, but we can will actions that shape those characters.

Mill addresses an obvious objection: what leads us to will to change our character? Isn’t that determined? Mill agrees. Our desire to change our character is determined largely by our experience of painful and pleasant consequences associated with our character. For Mill, however, the important point is that, even if we don’t control the desire to change our character, we are still left with the feeling of moral freedom, which is the feeling of being able to modify our own character “if we wish.” (System, VI.ii.3). What Mill wants to save in the doctrine of free will is simply the feeling that we have “real power over the formation of our own character.” (CW, I.177). If we have the desire to change our character, we find that we can. If we lack that desire it is “of no consequence what we think forms our character,” because we don’t care about altering it. For Mill, this is a thick enough notion of freedom to avoid fatalism.

One of the basic problems for this kind of naturalistic picture of human beings and wills is that it clashes with our first-person image of ourselves as reasoners and agents. As Kant understood, and as the later hermeneutic tradition emphasizes, we think of ourselves as autonomous followers of objectively given rules (Skorupski 1989, 279). It seems extremely difficult to provide a convincing naturalistic account of, for example, making a choice (without explaining away as illusory our first-person experience of making choices).

The desire to treat the will as an object, like ice or gunpowder, open to natural scientific study falls within Mill’s broader claim that the moral sciences, which include economics, history, and psychology among others, are fundamentally similar to the natural sciences. Though we may have difficulty running experiments in the human realm, that realm and its objects are, in principle, just as open to the causal explanations we find in physics or biology.

Perhaps the most interesting element of his analysis of the moral sciences is his commitment to what has been called “methodological individualism,” or the view that social and political phenomena are explicable by appeal to the behavior of individuals. In other words, social facts are reducible to facts about individuals: “The laws of the phenomena of society are, and can be, nothing but the laws of the actions and passions of human beings united together in the social state. Men, however, in a state of society, are still men; their actions and passions are obedient to the laws of individual human nature. Men are not, when brought together, converted into another kind of substance with different properties.” (System, VI.vii.1).

This position puts Mill in opposition to Auguste Comte, a founding figure in social theory (he coined the term “sociology”) and an important influence on, and correspondent with, Mill. Comte takes sociology rather than psychology to be the most basic of human sciences and takes individuals and their conduct to be best understood through the lens of social analysis. To put it simplistically, for Comte, the individual is an abstraction from the whole—its beliefs and conduct are determined by history and society. We understand the individual best, on this view, when we see the individual as an expression of its social institutions and setting. This naturally leads to a kind of historicism. Though Mill recognized the important influences of social institutions and history on individuals, for him society is nevertheless only able to shape individuals through affecting their experiences—experiences structured by universal principles of human psychology that operate in all times and places. (See Mandelbaum 1971, 167ff).

b. An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy

Mill’s attacks on intuitionism continued throughout his life. One notable example is his 1865 An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy, which revisits much of the same ground as A System of Logic in the guise of a thorough-going criticism of Hamilton, a thinker influenced by Reid and Kant whom Mill took as representing “the great fortress of the intuitional philosophy in this country.” (CW, I.270). The rather hefty volume explores “some of the disputed questions in the domain of psychology and metaphysics.” (CW, I.271).

Among the doctrines given most attention is that of the “relativity of knowledge,” something to which Mill takes Hamilton as insufficiently committed. It is the idea that we have no access to “things-in-themselves” (thus, the relativity versus absoluteness of knowledge) and that we are limited to analyzing the phenomena of consciousness. Mill, who accepts this basic principle, counts himself as a Berkeleian phenomenalist and famously defines matter in the Examination as “a Permanent Possibility of Sensation,” (CW, IX.183), thinks that Hamilton accepts this doctrine in a confused manner. “He affirms without reservation, that certain attributes (extension, figures, etc.) are known to us as they really exist out of ourselves; and also that all our knowledge of them is relative to us. And these two assertions are only reconcileable, if relativity to us is understood in the altogether trivial sense, that we know them only so far as our faculties permit.” (CW, IX.22). Hamilton therefore seems to want to have his cake and eat it too when it comes to knowledge of the external world. On the one hand, he wants to declare that we have access to things as they are, thereby aligning himself with Reid’s project of avoiding the fall into (Humean) skepticism—a fall prompted by the Lockean “way of ideas.” On the other hand, he wants to follow Kant in limiting our knowledge of things-in-themselves, thereby reigning in the pretensions of metaphysical speculation. Mill avoids this dilemma by rejecting Hamilton’s position that we know things outside as they really are.

One point of historical interest about the Examination is the impact that it had on the way that the history of philosophy is taught. Mill’s demolition of Hamilton’s reputation led to the removal of Reid and the school of Scottish “common sense” philosophy from the curriculum in Britain and America. As Kuklick puts it, the success of Mill’s Examination “is the crucial event in understanding the development of the contemporary view of Modern Philosophy in America.” By destroying “the credibility of the entire Scottish reply to Hume,” Mill’s Examination led Anglo-American philosophers to turn to Kant in the later part of the nineteenth century in order to find more satisfactory response to Humean skepticism (Kuklick 1984, 128). Thus, the standard course in Modern Philosophy that includes all or some of Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, and Kant, is partly an unintended consequence of the publication of Mill’s attack on Hamilton and on intuitionism more broadly.

c. Psychological Writings

As noted in the discussion of A System of Logic, Mill’s commitment to “methodological individualism” makes psychology the foundational moral science. Though he never wrote a work of his own on psychology, he edited and contributed notes to an 1869 re-issue of his father’s 1829 work in psychology, Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind, and reviewed the work of his friend and correspondent, Alexander Bain. All three were proponents of the associationist school of psychology, whose roots go back to Hobbes and especially Locke and whose members included Gay, Hartley, and Priestly in the eighteenth century and the Mills, Bain, and Herbert Spencer in the nineteenth century.

Mill distinguishes between the a posteriori and a priori schools of psychology. The former “resolves the whole contents of the mind into experience.” (CW, XI.341). The latter emphasizes that “in every act of thought, down to the most elementary, there is an ingredient which is not given to the mind, but contributed by the mind in virtue of its inherent powers.” (CW, XI.344). In the a priori or intuitionist school, experience “instead of being the source and prototype of our ideas, is itself a product of the mind’s own forces working on the impressions we receive from without, and has always a mental as well as an external element.” (CW, XI.344).

The associationist version of a posteriori psychology has two basic doctrines: “first, that the more recondite phenomena of the mind are formed out of the more simple and elementary; and, secondly, that the mental law, by means of which this formation takes place, is the Law of Association.” (CW, XI.345). The associationist psychologists, then, would attempt to explain mental phenomena by showing them to be the ultimate product of simpler components of experience (e.g. color, sound, smell, pleasure, pain) connected to each other through associations. These associations take two basic forms: resemblance and contiguity in space and/or time. Thus, these psychologists attempt to explain our idea of an orange or our feelings of greed as the product of simpler ideas connected by association.

Part of the impulse for this account of psychology is its apparent scientific character and beauty. Associationism attempts to explain a large variety of mental phenomena on the basis of experience plus very few mental laws of association. It therefore appeals to those who are particularly drawn to simplicity in their scientific theories.

Another attraction of associationist psychology, however, is its implications for views on moral education and social reform. If the contents of our minds, including beliefs and moral feelings, are products of experiences that we undergo connected according to very simple laws, then this raises the possibility that human beings are capable of being radically re-shaped—that our natures, rather than being fixed, are open to major alteration. In other words, if our minds are cobbled together by laws of association working on the materials of experience, then this suggests that if our experiences were to change, so would our minds. This doctrine tends to place much greater emphasis on social and political institutions like the family, the workplace, and the state, than does the doctrine that the nature of the mind offers strong resistance to being shaped by experience (i.e. that the mind molds experience rather than being molded by it). Associationism thereby fits nicely into an agenda of reform, because it suggests that many of the problems of individuals are explained by their situations (and the associations that these situations promote) rather than by some intrinsic feature of the mind. As Mill puts it in the Autobiography in discussing the conflict between the intuitionist and a posteriori schools:

The practical reformer has continually to demand that changes be made in things which are supported by powerful and widely spread feelings, or to question the apparent necessity and indefeasibleness of established facts; and it is often an indispensable part of his argument to shew, how these powerful feelings had their origin, and how those facts came to seem necessary and indefeasible. There is therefore a natural hostility between him and a philosophy which discourages the explanation of feelings and moral facts by circumstances and association, and prefers to treat them as ultimate elements of human nature…I have long felt that the prevailing tendency to regard all the marked distinctions of human character as innate, and in the main indelible, and to ignore the irresistible proofs that by far the greater part of those differences, whether between individuals, races, or sexes, are such as not only might but naturally would be produced by differences in circumstances, is one of the chief hindrances to the rational treatment of great social questions, and one of the greatest stumbling blocks to human improvement. (CW, I.269-70).

d. Utilitarianism

Another maneuver in his battle with intuitionism came when Mill published Utilitarianism (1861) in installments in Fraser’s Magazine (it was later brought out in book form in 1863). It offers a candidate for a first principle of morality, a principle that provides us with a criterion distinguishing right and wrong. The utilitarian candidate is the principle of utility, which holds that “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness; wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness. By happiness is intended pleasure and the absence of pain; by unhappiness, pain and the privation of pleasure.” (CW, X.210).

i. History of the Principle of Utility

By Mill’s time, the principle of utility possessed a long history stretching back to the 1730’s (with roots going further back to Hobbes, Locke, and even to Epicurus). In the eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries, it had been explicitly invoked by three British intellectual factions. Though all may have agreed that an action’s consequences for the general happiness were to dictate its rightness or wrongness, the reasons behind the acceptance of that principle and the uses to which the principle was put varied greatly.

The earliest supporters of the principle of utility were the religious utilitarians represented by, among others, John Gay, John Brown, Soame Jenyns, and, most famously, William Paley, whose 1785 The Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy was one of the most frequently re-printed and well read books of moral thought of the late eighteenth and early nineteenth centuries (to Mill’s dismay, Bentham’s utilitarianism was often conflated with Paley’s). Religious utilitarianism was very popular among the educated classes and dominated in the universities until the 1830’s. These thinkers were all deeply influenced by Locke’s empiricism and psychological hedonism and often stood opposed to the competing moral doctrines of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, Clarke, and Wollaston.

The religious utilitarians looked to the Christian God to address a basic problem, namely how to harmonize the interests of individuals, who are motivated by their own happiness, with the interests of the society as a whole. Once we understand that what we must do is what God wills (because of God’s power of eternal sanction) and that God wills the happiness of his creatures, morality and our own self-interest will be seen to overlap. God guarantees that an individual’s self-interest lies in virtue, in furthering the happiness of others. Without God and his sanctions of eternal punishment and reward, it would be hard to find motives that “are likely to be found sufficient to withhold men from the gratification of lust, revenge, envy, ambition, avarice.” (Paley 2002 [1785], 39). As we shall see in a moment, another possible motivation for caring about the general happiness—this one non-religious—is canvassed by Mill in Chapter Three of Utilitarianism.

In contrast to religious utilitarianism, which had few aspirations to be a moral theory that revises ordinary moral attitudes, the two late-eighteenth century secular versions of utilitarianism grew out of various movements for reform. The principle of utility—and the correlated commitments to happiness as the only intrinsically desirable end and to the moral equivalency of the happiness of different individuals—was itself taken to be an instrument of reform.

One version of secular utilitarianism was represented by William Godwin (husband of Mary Wollstonecraft and father of Mary Shelley), who achieved great notoriety with the publication of his Political Justice of 1793. Though his fame (or infamy) was relatively short-lived, Godwin’s use of the principle of utility for the cause of radical political and social critique began the identification of utilitarianism with anti-religiosity and with dangerous democratic values.

The second version of secular utilitarianism, and the one that inspired Mill, arose from the work of Jeremy Bentham. Bentham, who was much more successful than Godwin at building a movement around his ideas, employed the principle of utility as a device of political, social, and legal criticism. It is important to note, however, that Bentham’s interest in the principle of utility did not arise from concern about ethical theory as much as from concern about legislative and legal reform.

This history enables us to understand Mill’s invocation of the principle of utility in its polemical context—Mill’s support of that principle should not be taken as mere intellectual exercise. In the realm of politics, the principle of utility served to bludgeon opponents of reform. First and foremost, reform meant extension of the vote. But it also meant legal reform, including overhaul of the common law system and of legal institutions, and varieties of social reform, especially of institutions that tended to favor aristocratic and moneyed interests. Though Bentham and Godwin intended it to have this function in the late eighteenth century, utilitarianism became influential only when tied with the political machinery of the Radical party, which had particular prominence on the English scene in the 1830’s.

In the realm of ethical debate, Mill took his opponents to be the “intuitionists” led by Sedgwick and Whewell, both Cambridge men. They were the contemporary representatives of an ethical tradition that understood its history as tied to Butler, Reid, Coleridge, and turn of the century German thought (especially that of Kant). Though intuitionists and members of Mill’s a posteriori or “inductive” school recognize “to a great extent, the same moral laws,” they differ “as to their evidence and the source from which they derive their authority. According to the one opinion, the principles of morals are evident a priori, requiring nothing to command assent except that the meaning of the terms be understood. According to the other doctrine, right and wrong, as well as truth and falsehood, are questions of observation and experience.” (CW, X.206).

The chief danger represented by the proponents of intuitionism was not from the ethical content of their theories per se, which defended honesty, justice, benevolence, etc., but from the kinds of justifications offered for their precepts and the support such a view lent to the social and political status quo. As we saw in the discussion of the System of Logic and with reference to Mill’s statements in his Autobiography, he takes intuitionism to be dangerous because it allegedly enables people to ratify their own prejudices as moral principles—in intuitionism, there is no “external standard” by which to adjudicate differing moral claims (for example, Mill understood Kant’s categorical imperative as getting any moral force it possesses either from considerations of utility or from mere prejudice hidden by hand-waving). The principle of utility, alternatively, evaluates moral claims by appealing to the external standard of pain and pleasure. It presented each individual for moral consideration as someone capable of suffering and enjoyment.

ii. Basic Argument

Mill’s defense of the principle of utility in Utilitarianism includes five chapters. In the first, Mill sets out the problem, distinguishes between the intuitionist and “inductive” schools of morality, and also suggests limits to what we can expect from proofs of first principles of morality. He argues that “(q)uestions of ultimate ends are not amenable to direct proof.” (CW, X.207). All that can be done is to present considerations “capable of determining the intellect either to give or withhold its assent to the doctrine; and this is equivalent to proof.” (CW, X.208). Ultimately, he will want to prove in Chapter Four the basis for the principle of utility—that happiness is the only intrinsically desirable thing—by showing that we spontaneously accept it on reflection. (Skorupski 1989, 8). It is rather easy to show that happiness is something we desire intrinsically, not for the sake of other things. What is hard is to show that it is the only thing we intrinsically desire or value. Mill agrees that we do not always value things like virtue as means or instruments to happiness. We do sometimes seem to value such things for their own sakes. Mill contends, however, that on reflection we will see that when we appear to value them for their own sakes we are actually valuing them as parts of happiness (rather than as intrinsically desirable on their own or as means to happiness). That is, we value virtue, freedom, etc. as things that make us happy by their mere possession. This is all the proof we can give that happiness is our only ultimate end; it must rely on introspection and on careful and honest examination of our feelings and motives.

In Chapter Two, Mill corrects misconceptions about the principle of utility. One misconception is that utilitarianism, by endorsing the Epicurean view “that life has…no higher end than pleasure” is a “doctrine worthy only of swine.” (CW, X.210). Mill counters that “the accusation supposes human beings to be capable of no pleasures except those of which swine are capable.” (CW, X.210). He proffers a distinction (one not found in Bentham) between higher and lower pleasures, with higher pleasures including mental, aesthetic, and moral pleasures. When we are evaluating whether or not an action is good by evaluating the happiness that we can expect to be produced by it, he argues that higher pleasures should be taken to be in kind (rather than by degree) preferable to lower pleasures. This has led scholars to wonder whether Mill’s utilitarianism differs significantly from Bentham’s and whether Mill’s distinction between higher and lower pleasures creates problems for our ability to know what will maximize aggregate happiness.

A second objection to the principle of utility is that “it is exacting too much to require that people shall always act from the inducement of promoting the general interest of society.” (CW, X.219). Mill replies that this is to “confound the rule of action with the motive of it.” (CW, X.219). Ethics is supposed to tell us what our duties are, “but no system of ethics requires that the sole motive of all we do shall be a feeling of duty; on the contrary, ninety-nine hundredths of all our actions are done from other motives, and rightly so done if the rule of duty does not condemn them.” (CW, X.219). To do the right thing, in other words, we do not need to be constantly motivated by concern for the general happiness. The large majority of actions intend the good of individuals (including ourselves) rather than the good of the world. Yet the world’s good is made up of the good of the individuals that constitute it and unless we are in the position of, say, a legislator, we act properly by looking to private rather than to public good. Our attention to the public well-being usually needs to extend only so far as is required to know that we aren’t violating the rights of others.

Chapter Three addresses the topic of motivation again by focusing on the following question: What is the source of our obligation to the principle of utility? What, in other words, motivates us to act in ways approved of by the principle of utility? With any moral theory, one must remember that ‘ought implies can,’ i.e. that if moral demands are to be legitimate, we must be the kind of beings that can meet those demands. Mill defends the possibility of a strong utilitarian conscience (i.e. a strong feeling of obligation to the general happiness) by showing how such a feeling can develop out of the natural desire we have to be in unity with fellow creatures—a desire that enables us to care what happens to them and to perceive our own interests as linked with theirs. Though Chapter Two showed that we do not need to attend constantly to the general happiness, it is nevertheless a sign of moral progress when the happiness of others, including the happiness of those we don’t know, becomes important to us.

Finally, Chapter Five shows how utilitarianism accounts for justice. In particular, Mill shows how utilitarianism can explain the special status we seem to grant to justice and to the violations of it. Justice is something we are especially keen to defend. Mill begins by marking off morality (the realm of duties) from expediency and worthiness by arguing that duties are those things we think people ought to be punished for not fulfilling. He then suggests that justice is demarcated from other areas of morality, because it includes those duties to which others have correlative rights, “Justice implies something which it is not only right to do, and wrong not to do, but which some individual person can claim from us as his moral right.” (CW, X.247). Though no one has a right to my charity, even if I have a duty to be charitable, others have rights not to have me injure them or to have me repay what I have promised.

Critics of utilitarianism have placed special emphasis on its inability to provide a satisfactory account of rights. For Mill, to have a right is “to have something which society ought to defend me in the possession of. If the objector goes on to ask why it ought, I can give no other reason than general utility.” (CW, X.250). But what if the general utility demands that we violate your rights? The intuition that something is wrong if your rights can be violated for the sake of the general good provoked the great challenge to utilitarian conceptions of justice, leveled with special force by twentieth century thinkers like John Rawls.

e. On Liberty

The topic of justice received further treatment at Mill’s hands in his famous 1859 book On Liberty. This work is the one, along with A System of Logic, that Mill thought would have the most longevity. It concerns civil and social liberty or, to look at it from the contrary point of view, the nature and limits of the power that can legitimately be exercised by society over the individual.

Mill begins by retelling the history of struggle between rulers and ruled and suggests that social rather than political tyranny is the greater danger for modern, commercial nations like Britain. This social “tyranny of the majority” (a phrase Mill takes from Tocqueville) arises from the enforcement of rules of conduct that are both arbitrary and strongly adhered to. The practical principle that guides the majority “to their opinions on the regulation of human conduct, is the feeling in each person’s mind that everybody should be required to act as he, and those with whom he sympathizes, would like them to act.” (On Liberty [OL], 48). Such a feeling is particularly dangerous because it is taken to be self-justifying and self-evident.

There is a need, therefore, for a rationally grounded principle which governs a society’s dealings with individuals. This “one very simple principle”—often called the “harm principle”—entails that:

[T]he sole end for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively, in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number, is self-protection. That the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. His own good, either physical or moral, is not a sufficient warrant. He cannot rightfully be compelled to do or forbear because it will be better for him to do so, because it will make him happier, because, in the opinion of others, to do so would be wise, or even right. These are good reasons for remonstrating with him, or reasoning with him, or persuading him, or entreating him, but not for compelling him, or visiting him with any evil in case he do otherwise. (OL, 51-2)

This anti-paternalistic principle identifies three basic regions of human liberty: the “inward domain of consciousness,” liberty of tastes and pursuits (i.e. of framing our own life plan), and the freedom to unite with others.

Mill, unlike other liberal theorists, makes no appeal to “abstract right” in order to justify the harm principle. The reason for accepting the freedom of individuals to act as they choose, so long as they cause minimal or no harm to others, is that it would promote “utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interests of man as a progressive being.” (OL, 53). In other words, abiding by the harm principle is desirable because it promotes what Mill calls the “free development of individuality” or the development of our humanity.

Behind this rests the idea that humanity is capable of progress—that latent or underdeveloped abilities and virtues can be actualized under the right conditions. Human nature is not static. It is not merely re-expressed in generations and individuals. It is “not a machine to be built after a model, and set to do exactly the work prescribed for it, but a tree, which requires to grow and develop itself on all sides, according to the tendency of the inward forces which make it a living thing.” (OL, 105). Though human nature can be thought of as something living, it is also, like an English garden, something amenable to improvement through effort. “Among the works of man, which human life is rightly employed in perfecting and beautifying, the first in importance surely is man himself.” (OL, 105). The two conditions that promote development of our humanity are freedom and variety of situation, both of which the harm principle encourages.

A basic philosophical problem presented by the work is what counts as “harm to others.” Where should we mark the boundary between conduct that is principally self-regarding versus conduct that involves others? Does drug-use cause harm to others sufficient to be prevented? Does prostitution? Pornography? Should polygamy be allowed? How about public nudity? Though these are difficult questions, Mill provides the reader with a principled way of deliberating about them.

f. The Subjection of Women and Other Social and Political Writings

Many volumes of Mill’s writings deal with topics of social and political concern. These include writings on specific political problems in India, America, Ireland, France, and England, on the nature of democracy (Considerations on Representative Government) and civilization, on slavery, on law and jurisprudence, on the workplace, and on the family and the status of women. The last subject was the topic of Mill’s well-known The Subjection of Women, an important work in the history of feminism.

The radical nature of Mill’s call for women’s equality is often lost to us after over a century of protest and changing social attitudes. Yet the subordination of women to men when Mill was writing remains striking. Among other indicators of this subordination are the following: (1) British women had fewer grounds for divorce than men until 1923; (2) Husbands controlled their wives personal property (with the occasional exception of land) until the Married Women’s Property Acts of 1870 and 1882; (3) Children were the husband’s; (4) Rape was impossible within a marriage; and (5) Wives lacked crucial features of legal personhood, since the husband was taken as the representative of the family (thereby eliminating the need for women’s suffrage). This gives some indication of how disturbing and/or ridiculous the idea of a marriage between equals could appear to Victorians.

The object of the essay was to show “(t)hat the principle which regulates the existing social relations between the two sexes—the legal subordination of one sex to the other—is wrong in itself, and now one of the chief hindrances to human improvement; and that it ought to be replaced by a principle of perfect equality, admitting no power or privilege on the one side, nor disability on the other.” (CW, XXI.261). This shows how Mill appeals to both the patent injustice of contemporary familial arrangements and to the negative moral impact of those arrangements on the people within them. In particular, he discusses the ways in which the subordination of women negatively affects not only the women, but also the men and children in the family. This subordination stunts the moral and intellectual development of women by restricting their field of activities, pushing them either into self-sacrifice or into selfishness and pettiness. Men, alternatively, either become brutal through their relationships with women or turn away from projects of self-improvement to pursue the social “consideration” that women desire.

It is important to note that Mill’s concern for the status of women dovetails with the rest of his thought—it is not a disconnected issue. For example, his support for women’s equality was buttressed by associationism, which claims that minds are created by associative laws operating on experience. This implies that if we change the experiences and upbringing of women, then their minds will change. This enabled Mill to argue against those who tried to suggest that the subordination of women to men reflected a natural order that women were by nature incapable of equality with men. If many women were incapable of true friendship with noble men, says Mill, that is not a result of their natures, but of their faulty environments.

g. Principles of Political Economy

Another work that addresses issues of social and political concern is Mill’s Principles of Political Economy of 1848. The book went through numerous editions and served as the dominant British textbook in economics until being displaced by Alfred Marshall’s 1890 Principles of Economics. Mill intended the work as both a survey of contemporary economic thought (highlighting the theories of David Ricardo, but also including some contributions of his own on topics like international trade) and as an exploration of applications of economic ideas to social concerns. It was “not a book merely of abstract science, but also of application, and treated Political Economy not as a thing by itself, but as a fragment of a greater whole.” (CW, I.243). These two interests nicely divide the text into the first three more technical books on production, distribution, and exchange and the last two books, which address the influences of societal progress and of government on economic activity (and vice versa). The technical work is largely obsolete. Mill’s relating of economics and society, however, remains of great interest.

In particular, Mill shared concerns with others (e.g. Carlyle, Coleridge, Southey, etc.) about the moral impact of industrialization. Though many welcomed the material wealth produced by industrialization, there was a sense that those very cornerstones of British economic growth—the division of labor (including the increasing simplicity and repetitiveness of the work) and the growing size of factories and businesses—led to a spiritual and moral deadening.

Coleridge expressed this in his contrast of mere “civilization” with “cultivation”:

The permanency of the nation…and its progressiveness and personal freedom…depend on a continuing and progressive civilization. But civilization is itself but a mixed good, if not far more a corrupting influence, the hectic of disease, not the bloom of health, and a nation so distinguished more fitly to be called a varnished than a polished people, where this civilization is not grounded in cultivation, in the harmonious development of those qualities and faculties that characterize our humanity. We must be men in order to be citizens. (Coleridge 1839, 46).

“Civilization” expresses central features of modernization, including industrialism, cosmopolitanism, and increasing material wealth. But, for Coleridge, civilization needed to be subordinated to cultivation of our humanity (expressed in terms similar to those later found in On Liberty).

This concern for the moral impact of economic growth explains, among other things, his commitment to a brand of socialism. In an essay on the French historian Michelet, Mill praises the monastic associations of Italy and France after the reforms of St. Benedict: “Unlike the useless communities of contemplative ascetics in the East, they were diligent in tilling the earth and fabricating useful products; they knew and taught that temporal work may also be a spiritual exercise.” (CW, XX.240). It was the desire to transform temporal work into a spiritual and moral exercise that led Mill to favor socialist changes in the workplace.

In order to transform the workplace from a setting filled with antagonism into a “school of sympathy” that would enable workers to feel a part of something greater than themselves—thereby mitigating the rampant selfishness encouraged by industrial society—Mill recommends “industrial co-operatives.” Mill thought that these co-operatives had the advantage over communes or other socialist institutions because they were able to compete against traditional firms (his complaint against many other socialists is that they undervalued competition as a morally useful stimulus to activity). These co-operatives can take two forms: a profit-sharing system in which worker pay is tied to the success of the business or a worker co-operative in which workers share ownership of capital. The latter was preferable because it turned all the workers into entrepreneurs, calling upon many of the faculties that mere labor for pay left to atrophy.

Though Mill contended that laborers were generally unfit for socialism given their current level of education and development, he thought that modern industrial societies should take small steps towards fostering co-operatives. Included among these steps was the institution of limited partnerships. Up to Mill’s time, partners shared full liability for losses, including any personal property they owned—obviously a strong deterrent to the founding of worker co-operatives.

Mill’s recommendations for the economic organization of society, like his political and social policies, always paid careful attention to how institutions, laws, and practices impacted the intellectual, moral, and affective well-being of the individuals operating under or within them.

h. Essays on Religion

Mill’s criticism of traditional religious doctrines and institutions and his promotion of the “Religion of Humanity,” also depended largely on concerns about human cultivation and education. Though the Benthamite “philosophic radicals,” including Mill, took Christianity to be a particularly pernicious superstition that fostered indifference or hostility to human happiness (the keystone of utilitarian morality), Mill also thought that religion could potentially serve important ethical needs by supplying us with “ideal conceptions grander and more beautiful than we see realized in the prose of human life.” (CW, X.419). In so doing, religion elevates our feelings, cultivates sympathy with others, and imbues even our smallest activities with a sense of purpose.

The posthumously published three Essays on Religion (1874)—on “Nature,” the “Utility of Religion,” and “Theism”—criticized traditional religious views and formulated an alternative in the guise of the Religion of Humanity. Along with the criticism of religion’s moral effects that he shared with the Benthamites, Mill was also critical of the intellectual laziness that permitted belief in an omnipotent and benevolent God. He felt, following his father, that the world as we find it could not possibly have come from such a God given the evils rampant in it; either his power is limited or he is not wholly benevolent.

Beyond attacking arguments concerning the essence of God, Mill undermines a variety of arguments for his existence including all a priori arguments. He concludes that the only legitimate proof of God is an a posteriori and probabilistic argument from the design of the universe – the traditional argument (stemming from Aristotle) that complex features of the world, like the eye, are unlikely to have arisen by chance, hence there must be a designer. (Mill acknowledges the possibility that Darwin, in his 1859 The Origin of Species, has provided a wholly naturalistic explanation of such features, but he suggests that it is too early to judge of Darwin’s success).

Inspired by Comte, Mill finds an alternative to traditional religion in the Religion of Humanity, in which an idealized humanity becomes an object of reverence and the morally useful features of traditional religion are supposedly purified and accentuated. Humanity becomes an inspiration by being placed imaginatively within the drama of human history, which has a destination or point, namely the victory of good over evil. As Mill puts it, history should be seen as “the unfolding of a great epic or dramatic action,” which terminates “in the happiness or misery, the elevation or degradation, of the human race.” It is “an unremitting conflict between good and evil powers, of which every act done by any of us, insignificant as we are, forms one of the incidents.” (CW, XXI.244). As we begin to see ourselves as participants in this Manichean drama, as fighting alongside people like Socrates, Newton, and Jesus to secure the ultimate victory of good over evil, we become capable of greater sympathy, moral feeling, and an ennobled sense of the meaning of our own lives. The Religion of Humanity thereby acts as an instrument of human cultivation.

3. Conclusion

Mill’s intellect engaged with the world rather than fled from it. His was not an ivory tower philosophy, even when dealing with the most abstract of philosophical topics. His work is of enduring interest because it reflects how a fine mind struggled with and attempted to synthesize important intellectual and cultural movements. He stands at the intersections of conflicts between enlightenment and romanticism, liberalism and conservatism, and historicism and rationalism. In each case, as someone interested in conversation rather than pronouncement, he makes sincere efforts to move beyond polemic into sustained and thoughtful analysis. That analysis produced challenging answers to problems that still remain. Whether or not one agrees with his answers, Mill serves as a model for thinking about human problems in a serious and civilized way.

4. References and Further Reading

* = works of note.

Primary Texts

  • Bentham, Jeremy. Deontology together with A Table of the Springs of Action and The Article on Utilitarianism. Edited by Amnon Goldworth. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1983.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1996.
  • Bentham, Jeremy. The Works of Jeremy Bentham. Edited by John Bowring. 10 vols. New York: Russell and Russell, 1962.
  • Carlyle, Thomas. A Carlyle Reader. Edited by G.B. Tennyson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • Carlyle, Thomas. Critical and Miscellaneous Essays. Philadelphia: Casey and Hart, 1845.
  • Carlyle, Thomas. Past and Present. London: Ward, Lock, and Bowden, Ltd., 1897.
  • Coleridge, S.T.C. On the Constitution of the Church and State According to the Idea of Each (3rd Edition), and Lay Sermons (2nd Edition). London: William Pickering, 1839.
  • Comte, Auguste. A General View of Positivism. 1848. Reprint. Dubuque, Iowa: Brown Reprints, 1971.
  • Mill, James. An Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind. Edited and with Notes by John Stuart Mill. London: Longmans, Green and Dyer, 1869.
  • *Mill, John Stuart. The Collected Works of John Stuart Mill. Gen. Ed. John M. Robson. 33 vols. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1963-91.
    • The standard scholarly editions including Mill’s published works, letters, and notes; an outstanding resource.
  • Mill, John Stuart. A System of Logic. New York: Harper & Brothers, 1874.
  • Mill, John Stuart. On Liberty. Peterborough, Canada: Broadview Press, 1999.
  • Paley, William. The Principles of Moral and Political Philosophy. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 2002 [1785].

Secondary Texts

  • Britton, Karl. ‘John Stuart Mill on Christianity.’ In James and John Stuart Mill: Papers of the Centenary Conference, John Robson and Michael Laine (eds.). Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1976.
  • *Capaldi, Nicholas. John Stuart Mill: A Biography. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
    • A recent and very thorough treatment of Mill’s life and work.
  • Carlisle, Janice. John Stuart Mill and the Writing of Character. Athens, GA: University of Georgia Press, 1991.
  • Collini, Stefan. ‘The Idea of “Character” in Victorian Political Thought.’ Transactions of the Royal Historical Society, 5th series, 35 (1985), 29-50.
  • *Collini, Stefan. Public Moralists, Political Thought and Intellectual Life in Great Britain 1850-1930. Oxford: Clarendon, 1991.
    • A useful history that includes discussion of Mill’s intellectual and institutional context.
  • *Collini, Stefan, Donald Winch, and John Burrow. That Noble Science of Politics: A Study in Nineteenth-century Intellectual History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
    • Very valuable work on nineteenth century British political discourse; includes discussion of the Philosophic Radicals.
  • Donner, Wendy. The Liberal Self: John Stuart Mill’s Moral and Political Philosophy. Ithaca: Cornell Univ. Press, 1991.
  • Harrison, Brian. ‘State Intervention and Moral Reform in nineteeth-century England.’ In Pressure from Without in Early Victorian England, edited by Patricia Hollis, 289-322. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1974.
  • *Halevy, Elie. The Growth of Philosophical Radicalism. Translated by Mary Morris. Boston: The Beacon Press, 1955.
    • Though originally published in 1904, this is still a seminal work in the history of utilitarianism.
  • Hamburger, Joseph. ‘Religion and “On Liberty.”’ In A Cultivated Mind: Essays on J.S. Mill Presented to John M. Robson, edited by Michael Laine, 139-81. Toronto: Univ. of Toronto Press, 1961.
  • Harrison, Ross. Bentham. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1983.
  • Hedley, Douglas. Coleridge, Philosophy and Religion: Aids to Reflection and the Mirror of the Spirit. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000.
  • Heydt, Colin. ‘Narrative, Imagination, and the Religion of Humanity in Mill’s Ethics.’ Journal of the History of Philosophy, vol. 44, no. I (Jan. 2006), 99-115.
  • Heydt, Colin. ‘Mill, Bentham, and “Internal Culture”.’ British Journal for the History of Philosophy, vol. 14, no. 2 (May 2006), 275-302.
  • Heydt, Colin. Rethinking Mill’s Ethics: Character and Aesthetic Education. London: Continuum Press, 2006.
  • *Hollander, Samuel. The Economics of John Stuart Mill (Toronto: UTP and Oxford: Blackwell), 1985: Volume I, Theory and Method. Volume II, Political Economy, 482-1030.
    • The seminal work on Mill’s economics.
  • Jenkyns, Richard. The Victorians and Ancient Greece. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1980.
  • Jones, H. S. ‘John Stuart Mill as Moralist.’ Journal of the History of Ideas 53 (1992): 287-308.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. ‘Seven thinkers and how they grew: Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz; Locke, Berkeley, Hume; Kant.’ In Philosophy in History, Rorty, Schneewind, Skinner (eds.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
  • *Mandelbaum, M. History, Man and Reason. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins Univ. Press, 1971.
    • An excellent intellectual history of Europe in the nineteenth century; contains very valuable discussions of Mill.
  • Matz, Lou. ‘The Utility of Religious Illusion: A Critique of J.S. Mill’s Religion of Humanity.’ Utilitas 12 (2000): 137-154.
  • Millar, Alan. ‘Mill on Religion.’ In The Cambridge Companion to Mill, John Skorupski (ed.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • *Packe, Michael. The Life of John Stuart Mill. New York: MacMillan Company, 1954.
    • Prior to Capaldi’s, the standard life; still contains useful biographical detail.
  • Raeder, Linda C. John Stuart Mill and the Religion of Humanity. Columbia: University of Missouri Press, 2002.
  • Robson, John M. The Improvement of Mankind: The Social and Political Thought of John Stuart Mill. Toronto: Toronto Univ. Press, 1968.
  • Robson, John. ‘J.S. Mill’s Theory of Poetry.’ In Mill: A Collection of Critical Essays, J. B. Schneewind, (ed.). London: MacMillan, 1968.
  • Ryan, Alan. The Philosophy of John Stuart Mill. London: MacMillan, 1970.
  • *Ryan, Alan. J.S. Mill. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1974.
    • A nice introduction to Mill’s writings and central arguments.
  • *Schneewind, J. B. Sidgwick’s Ethics and Victorian Moral Philosophy. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1977.
    • Still easily the best extant treatment of Victorian moral philosophy; includes extremely valuable examination of the conflict between utilitarianism and intuitionism.
  • Sen, Amartya, and Bernard Williams, eds. Utilitarianism and Beyond. Cambridge: Cambridge Univ. Press, 1982.
  • Shanely, Mary Lyndon. ‘Marital Slavery and Friendship: John Stuart Mill’s The Subjection of Women.’ Political Theory, Vol. 9, No. 2 (May 1981), 229-247.
  • Shanley, Mary Lyndon. ‘Suffrage, Protective Labor Legislation, and Married Women’s Property Laws in England.’ Signs, Vol. 12, No. 1 (1986).
  • *Skorupski, John. John Stuart Mill. London: Routledge, 1989.
    • Unquestionably, the best single book on Mill’s general philosophy.
  • Skorupski, John. ‘Introduction.’ In The Cambridge Companion to Mill, edited by John Skorupski. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • *Skorupski, John (editor). The Cambridge Companion to Mill. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
    • Includes a number of important articles and an extensive (though by now a little dated) bibliography.
  • Smart, J.J.C. ‘Extreme and Restricted Utilitarianism.’ The Philosophical Quarterly, (October 1956), 344-354.
  • *Thomas, William. The Philosophic Radicals: Nine Studies in Theory and Practice 1817-1841. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1979.
    • Very good resource for Philosophic Radicalism.
  • Turner, Michael J. “Radical Opinion in an Age of Reform: Thomas Perronet Thompson and the Westminster Review,” History, Vol. 86 (2001), Issue 281, 18-40.
  • Williams, Raymond. Culture and Society 1780-1950. New York: Columbia University Press, 1983.
  • *Wilson, Fred. Psychological Analysis and the Philosophy of John Stuart Mill. Toronto: Toronto Univ. Press, 1990.
    • Most thorough treatment of Mill’s psychological views.

Author Information

Colin Heydt
University of South Florida
U. S. A.

Anselm of Canterbury (1033—1109)

anselmSaint Anselm was one of the most important Christian thinkers of the eleventh century. He is most famous in philosophy for having discovered and articulated the so-called “ontological argument;” and in theology for his doctrine of the atonement. However, his work extends to many other important philosophical and theological matters, among which are: understanding the aspects and the unity of the divine nature; the extent of our possible knowledge and understanding of the divine nature; the complex nature of the will and its involvement in free choice; the interworkings of human willing and action and divine grace; the natures of truth and justice; the natures and origins of virtues and vices; the nature of evil as negation or privation; and the condition and implications of original sin.

In the course of his work and thought, unlike most of his contemporaries, Anselm deployed argumentation that was in most respects only indirectly dependent on Sacred Scripture, Christian doctrine, and tradition. Anselm also developed sophisticated analyses of the language used in discussion and investigation of philosophical and theological issues, highlighting the importance of focusing on the meaning of the terms used rather than allowing oneself to be misled by the verbal forms, and examining the adequacy of the language to the objects of investigation, particularly to the divine nature. In addition, in his work he both discussed and exemplified the resolution of apparent contradictions or paradoxes by making appropriate distinctions. For these reasons, one title traditionally accorded him is the Scholastic Doctor, since his approach to philosophical and theological matters both represents and contributed to early medieval Christian Scholasticism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Influences
  3. Methodology: Faith and Reason
  4. The Proslogion
  5. Gaunilo’s Reply and Anselm’s Response
  6. The Monologion
  7. Cur Deus Homo
  8. De Grammatico
  9. The De Veritate
  10. The De Libertate Arbitrii
  11. The De Casu Diaboli
  12. The De Concordia
  13. The Fragments
  14. Other Writings
  15. References and Further Readings
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Anselm was born in 1033 in Aosta, a border town of the kingdom of Burgundy. In his adolescence, he decided that there was no better life than the monastic one. He sought to become a monk, but was refused by the abbot of the local monastery. Leaving his birthplace as a young man, he headed north across the Alps to France, eventually arriving at Bec in Normandy, where he studied under the eminent theologian and dialectician Lanfranc, whose involvement in disputes with Berengar spurred a revival in theological speculation and application of dialectic in theological argument. At the monastery of Bec, Anselm devoted himself to scholarship, and found an earlier childhood attraction to the monastic life reawakening. Unable to decide between becoming a monk at Bec or Cluny, becoming a hermit, or living off his inheritance and giving alms to the poor, he put the decision in the hands of Lanfranc and Maurilius, the Archbishop of Rouen, who decided Anselm should enter monastic life at Bec, which he did in 1060.

In 1063, after Lanfranc left Bec for Caen, Anselm was chosen to be prior. Among the various tasks Anselm took on as prior was that of instructing the monks, but he also had time left for carrying on rigorous spiritual exercises, which would play a great role in his philosophical and theological development. As his biographer, Eadmer, writes: “being continually given up to God and to spiritual exercises, he attained such a height of divine speculation that he was able by God’s help to see into and unravel many most obscure and previously insoluble questions…” (1962, p. 12). He became particularly well known, both in the monastic community and in the wider community, not only for the range and depth of his insight into human nature, the virtues and vices, and the practice of moral and religious life, but also for the intensity of his devotions and asceticism.

In 1070, Anselm began to write, particularly prayers and meditations, which he sent to monastic friends and to noblewomen for use in their own private devotions. He also engaged in a great deal of correspondence, leaving behind numerous letters. Eventually, his teaching and thinking culminated in a set of treatises and dialogues. In 1077, he produced the Monologion, and in 1078 the Proslogion. Eventually, Anselm was elected abbot of the monastery. At some time while still at Bec, Anselm wrote the De Veritate (On Truth), De Libertate Arbitrii (On Freedom of Choice), De Casu Diaboli (On the Fall of the Devil), and De Grammatico.

In 1092, Anselm traveled to England, where Lanfranc had previously been arch-bishop of Canterbury. The Episcopal seat had been kept vacant so King William Rufus could collect its income, and Anselm was proposed as the new bishop, a prospect neither the king nor Anselm desired. Eventually, the king fell ill, changed his mind in fear of his demise, and nominated Anselm to become bishop. Anselm attempted to argue his unfitness for the post, but eventually accepted. In addition to the typical cares of the office, his tenure as arch-bishop of Canterbury was marked by nearly uninterrupted conflict over numerous issues with King William Rufus, who attempted not only to appropriate church lands, offices, and incomes, but even to have Anselm deposed. Anselm had to go into exile and travel to Rome to plead the case of the English church to the Pope, who not only affirmed Anselm’s position, but refused Anselm’s own request to be relieved of his office. While archbishop in exile, however, Anselm did finish his Cur Deus Homo, also writing the treatises Epistolae de Incarnatione Verbi (On the Incarnation of the Word), De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato (On the Virgin Conception and on Original Sin), De Processione Spiritus Sancti (On the Proceeding of the Holy Spirit), and De Concordia Praescientia et Praedestinationis et Gratiae Dei cum Libero Arbitrio (On the Harmony of the Foreknowledge, the Predestination, and the Grace of God with Free Choice).

Upon returning to England after William Rufus’s death, conflict eventually ensued between the archbishop and the new king, Henry I, requiring Anselm once again to travel to Rome. When judgment was made by Pope Paschal II in Anselm’s favor, the king forbade him to return to England, but eventually reconciliation took place. Anselm died in 1109, leaving behind several pupils and friends of some importance, among them Eadmer, Anselm’s biographer, and the theologian Gilbert Crispin. He was declared a doctor of the Roman Catholic Church in 1720, and is considered a saint by the Roman Catholic Church and the churches in the Anglican Communion.

Today, Anselm is most well known for his Proslogion proof for the existence of God, but his thought was widely known in the Middle Ages, and still today in certain circles of scholarship, particularly among religious scholars, for considerably more than that single achievement. For fuller biographies of Anselm, see Eadmer’s Vita Sancti AnselmiThe Life of St. Anselm: Archbishop of Canterbury, and Alexander’s Liber ex dictis beati Anselmi.

2. Influences

With the exception of St. Augustine, and to a lesser extent Boethius, it is difficult to definitively ascribe the influence of other thinkers to the development of St. Anselm’s thought. To be sure, Anselm studied under Lanfranc, but Lanfranc does not appear to have been a significant influence on the actual content or expression of Anselm’s thought, and he largely ignored Lanfranc’s misgivings about the method of theMonologion. Anselm cites Boethius, but does not draw upon him extensively. Other figures have been proposed as influences on Anselm, for instance John Scotus Eriugena and Pseudo-Dionysus, but any such proposals are set in the proper framework by these remarks from Koyré: “The influence of these two great thinkers is not at all lacking in verisimilitude a priori.” (Koyré 1923, 109). It is possible that either one of them, or other thinkers, influenced Anselm, but going beyond mere possibility given the texts we possess is controversial.

Discerning influences on Anselm’s work is for the most part conjectural, precisely because Anselm makes so few references to previous thinkers in his work. In the preface to the Monologion he writes: “Reexamining the work often myself, I have been able to find nothing that I have said in it, that would not agree [cohaereat] with the writings of the Catholic Fathers and especially with those of the blessed Augustine.” (S. v. 1, p.8)

[All citations of Anselm’s texts (except for the Fragments) are the author’s translations from S. Anselmi Cantuariensis Archepiscopi Opera Omnia, abbreviated here as S., followed by (when needed) the volume and the page numbers. Latin terms in brackets or parentheses have been romanized to current orthography. All citations of the Fragments are the author’s translations from the Ein neues unvollendetes Werk des heilige Anselm von Canterbury, henceforth abbreviated as u.W.]

Anselm references Augustine’s On the Holy Trinity, but as a whole work, giving no specific references. Clearly, Augustine was a major influence on Anselm’s thought, but that is in itself rather unremarkable, since practically all of his contemporaries fit in one way or another into the broad stream of the Augustinian tradition. As Southern summarizes the issues: “[T]he ambivalence of Anselm’s relations to St. Augustine remains one of the mysteries of his mind and personality. Augustine’s thought was the pervading atmosphere in which Anselm moved; but he was never content merely to reproduce Augustine.” (1963, 32)

In fact, one of the most important features of Anselm’s work is its originality. As Southern has also pointed out, this originality was not confined to the treatises and dialogues. In his more devotional prayers and meditations, Anselm adapted traditional forms to new content, (1963, 34-47) “open[ing] the way which led to the Dies Irae, the Imitatio Christi, and the masterpieces of later medieval piety.” (1963, 47) Although clearly indebted to an Augustinian (neo)-Platonic tradition often termed “Christian philosophy,” Anselm’s originality clearly furthered and expanded that tradition, and prepared the way for later Scholasticism. The term “Christian philosophy” was used in a variety of senses, particularly within and to denote the Augustinian tradition, and was applied to Anselm’s work by numerous interpreters. A set of debates, which gave rise to a sizable literature, and which are still to some extent being continued today, took place in Francophone circles (spreading to German, Italian, Spanish, and English-speaking circles in later years) in the early 1930s, about the nature and possibility of “Christian philosophy.” One of the main participants, Etienne Gilson, in fact used Anselm’s formula fides quaerens intellectum several times as one of the definitions of Christian philosophy.

Anselm’s work was influential for some of his contemporaries, and has continued to exercise influence in varying ways on philosophers and theologians to the present day. The so-called “ontological argument” has had numerous critics, defenders, and adaptors philosophically or theologically notable in their own right, among them St. Bonaventure, St. Thomas Aquinas, Descartes, Gassendi, Spinoza, Malebranche, Locke, Leibniz, Kant, Hegel, and an even greater number in the last century, not least of which were Charles Hartshorne, Etienne Gilson, Maurice Blondel, Martin Heidegger, Karl Barth, Norman Malcolm, and Alvin Plantinga. However, the “argument”(s) discussed in this literature are frequently not precisely what is found in Anselm’s texts, and a sizable literature has developed addressing that very issue.

Argument(s) for God’s being or existence form only a small portion of Anselm’s considerable and complex work, and his influence has been much wider and deeper than originating one perennial line of philosophical investigation and discussion. In his own time, he had several gifted students, among them Anselm of Laon, Gilbert Crispin, Eadmer (writer of the Vita Anselmi), Alexander (writer of the Dicta Anselmi), and Honorius Augustodunensis. His works were copied and disseminated in his lifetime, and exercised an influence on later Scholastics, among them Bonaventure, Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, and William of Ockham. For further discussion of Anselm’s influence, cf. Châtillon, 1959, Southern, 1963, Rovighi, 1964, Hopkins, 1972, and Fortin, 2001.

3. Methodology: Faith and Reason

The extent to which Anselm’s work, and which portions of it, ought to be considered to be philosophy or theology (or “philosophical theology,” “Christian philosophy,” and so forth) is a long debated question. The answers (and their rationales) depend considerably on one’s conceptions of philosophy and theology and their distinction and interaction. These admittedly important issues are set aside here in order to focus on three key features of Anselm’s work: Anselm’s pedagogical motivation and his intended audience; the notion of faith seeking understanding (fides quaerens intellectum); and Anselm’s stylistics and dialectic.

Anselm provides a paradigmatic account of the pedagogical motive structuring his works in theMonologion’s Prologue.

Some of the brothers have often and earnestly entreated me to set down in writing for them some of the matters I have brought to light for them when we spoke together in our accustomed discourses, about how the divine essence ought to be meditated upon and certain other things pertaining to that sort of meditation, as a kind of model for meditation.... They prescribed this form for me: nothing whatsoever in these matters should be made convincing [persuaderetur] by the authority of Scripture, but whatsoever the conclusion [finis], through individual investigations, should assert...the necessity of reason would concisely prove [cogeret], and the clarity of truth would evidently show that this is the case. They also wished that I not disdain to meet and address [obviare] simpleminded and almost foolish objections that occurred to me. (S. v. 1, p.7)

The original audience for his writings was fellow Benedictine monks seeking a fuller understanding of the Christian faith and asking that Anselm provide an articulation of it in a form quite different than those typical and traditional of their time, namely, where such theological discussions were carried out primarily through citation and interpretation of Scripture and patristic authorities. Anselm expresses this pedagogical motive again in the Cur Deus Homo: “I have often and most earnestly been asked by many, in speech and in writing, to commit in writing to posterity [memoriae. . commendem] reasonable answers [rationes] I am accustomed to give to those asking about a certain question of our faith.” (S. v. 2, p.47)

The goal of Anselm’s treatises is not to provide a philosophical substitute for the Christian faith, nor to rationalize or systematize it solely in the light of natural reason. Rather, in the cases of the Monologionand Proslogion, he aims to treat meditatively, by reason’s resources, central aspects of the Christian faith, namely, as he puts it in the Proslogion’s Prologue: “that God truly is, and that he is the supreme good needing no other, and that he is what all things need so that they are and so that they are well, and whatever else we believe about the divine substance.” (S., v. 1, p. 93) In the other treatises (excepting theDe Grammatico, which he explicitly states to be for “beginners in dialectic,” and that it “pertains to a different subject matter than [Sacred Scripture],” S., v.1, p. 173), Anselm concerns himself with other important, and often interrelated, aspects of the Christian faith, developing the arguments through reasoning, rather than through explicit reliance on Scriptural or patristic authority in the course of argumentation. Over the course of his career, Anselm’s intended audience expands considerably, however, particularly as he became involved in controversy over the Trinity that culminated in hisEpistola de Incarnatione Verbi and Cur Deus Homo.

The Proslogion’s Prologue provides a somewhat different, but clearly related motive for its production. After the Monologion, Anselm writes: “considering that that work was constructed from an interlinking [concatenatione] of many arguments, I began to wonder if perhaps a single argument [unum argumentum] that needed nothing other than itself alone for proving itself.” (S., v. 1, p. 93) Once he had uncovered this unum argumentum (“single argument”) after great effort and difficulty, Anselm wrote about it and several other related topics, in the interest of sharing the joy it had brought him, or at least pleasing another who would read it (alicui legenti placiturum).

Precisely what this single argument consists of has been a subject of considerable scholarly debate. A fairly common but clearly incorrect interpretation of the “single argument” takes it as referring only to the proof for God’s existence or being in Chapter 2, or at most Chapters 2-4. At the other extreme, some commentators take the single argument to be the entirety of the Proslogion. A third, intermediary position argues that the unum argumentum is the entirety of the Proslogion, minus the last three chapters, for two reasons: 1) Anselm calls the last three chapters coniectationes; 2) Anselm says in the prooemium that he wrote the Proslogion about the argument itself (de hoc ipso) and about several other things (et de quibusdam aliis).

As Anselm explains to his interlocutor Boso, his writing the De Conceptu Virginali is motivated by a purpose similar to that of the Proslogion, reexamining and rearticulating topics previously addressed in other works.

For I am certain that when you read in the Cur Deus Homo. . . that, besides the one I set down there, another reason can be glimpsed [posse uideri], how God took on humanity without sin from the sinful mass of the human race, your most studious mind will be driven not a little to asking what this reason is. Accordingly, I feared that I would appear unjust to you if I conceal what I think on this [quod inde mihi videtur] from your enjoyment [dilectioni tuae]. (S., v. 2, p. 139)

The prologue to the three connected dialogues (De VeritateDe Libertate ArbitriiDe Casu Diaboli) does not indicate conclusively whether they were written to answer specific requests of the monks. Clearly, however, they treat matters of both theological and philosophical interest arising out of reflection and discussion on Christian faith, life, and thought.

Fides quaerens intellectum, “faith seeking understanding” was the Proslogion’s original title and is an apt designation for Anselm’s philosophical and theological projects as a whole. Anselm begins from, and never leaves the standpoint of a committed and practicing Catholic Christian, but this does not mean that his philosophical work is thereby vitiated as philosophy by operating on the basis of and within the confines of theological presuppositions. Rather, Anselm engages in philosophy, employing reasoning rather than appeal to Scriptural or patristic authority in order to establish the doctrines of the Christian faith (which, as a faithful and practicing believer, he takes as already established) in a different, but possible way, through the employment of reason. Faith seeking understanding goes beyond simply establishing faith’s doctrines, however, precisely because it seeks understanding, the rational intelligibility (as far as is possible) of the doctrines.

Anselm does cite Scripture at certain points in his work, as well as “what we believe” (quod credimus), but attention to his texts indicates that he does not rely on scriptural or doctrinal authority directly to resolve problems or to provide starting points for his reasoning. In some cases, he has the student or his own questioning voice (as in Proslogion, Chapter 8) bring up Scriptural passages of truths of Christian doctrine in order to raise problems that require a rational resolution. In other cases (as in De Concordia, Book 1 Chapter 5), he does use Scriptural passages as starting points for arguments, but for erroneous arguments that he then criticizes. In yet other cases, Anselm brings up Scripture precisely to explain how certain passages or expressions should be rightly understood (as in the De Casu Diaboli, explaining how God causing evil should be understood). Lastly, Anselm cites Scripture after the course of his argument in order to reconnect the rational argumentation with Christian revelation (as in Proslogion, Chapter 16, where Anselm’s previous reasoning culminates in God “inhabiting” an “inaccessible light”). For discussion of Anselm and Scripture, cf. Barth, 1960, Tonini, 1970, and Henry, 1962.

In his actual exercise of reason, Anselm displays both confidence in reason’s capacity for providing understanding to faith, and awareness of the limitations human reason’s exercise eventually runs into and becomes aware of. For instance, in Proslogion, Chapter 15, he concludes that God is not only that than which nothing greater can be thought, but something greater than can be thought. Another important aspect of Anselm’s fides quaerens intellectum is that, in the Monologion, reason is employed by one who “disputes and investigates with himself things he had not previously taken notice of [non animadvertisset],” (S., v. 1, p. 8) and in the Proslogion, one “striving to raise his mind to the contemplation of God, and seeking to understand what he believes.” (S., v. 1, p. 94)

Despite Anselm’s deliberate employment of reason as a means to the truth about both the natural and the supernatural order, his rationalism is a mitigated one. Monologion Chapter 1 exemplifies this. Anselm’s assessment is that one could persuade oneself of the truths argued for in the Monologion by the use of one’s reason, but Anselm hastens to add: “I wish it to be understood [accipi] that, even if a conclusion is reached [concludatur] seemingly as necessary [quasi necessarium] from reasons that seem good to me, it is not that it is entirely [omnino] necessary, but only that for the current time [interim] it be said to be able to appear necessary.” (S., v. 1, p.14)

Chapter 64 of the Monologion provides another important discussion of the use of reason and argument. Anselm distinguishes between being able to understand or explain that something is true or that something exists, and being able to understand or explain how something is true. Since the divine substance, the triune God is ultimately beyond the capacities of human understanding, reason, or more precisely the reasoning human subject, must recognize both the limits and the capacities of reason.

I think that for someone investigating an incomprehensible matter it ought to be sufficient, if by reasoning towards it, he arrives at knowing that it most certainly does exist, even if he is unable to go further by use of the intellect [penetrare. . . intellectu] into how it is this way. Nor for that reason should we withhold the certainty of faith from those things that are asserted through necessary proofs [probationibus], and that are inconsistent with no other reason, if because of the incomprehensibility of their natural sublimity they do not allow themselves [non patiuntur] to be explained. (S., v. 1, p. 75)

Anselm is not skeptically questioning or undermining the capacities of reason and argumentation. Not every possible object the intellect attempts to engage with presents such problems, but only God. Accordingly, although a completely full and exhaustively systematic account cannot be provided of the divine substance, this does not undermine the certainty of what reason has been able to determine.

Stylistically, Anselm’s treatises take two basic forms, dialogues and sustained meditations. The former represent pedagogical discussions between a fairly gifted and inquisitive pupil and a teacher. In the latter, Anselm provides, as noted earlier, models of meditation, but the model differs considerably from theMonologion to the Proslogion, for in the first treatise, Anselm aims to provide a model of a person meditating, or (using Aristotle’s conception) engaging in dialectic with himself, while in the second case, the person addresses himself to the very God that he is attempting to comprehend as best as human capacities allow.

In the dialogue Cur Deus Homo, a student, Boso, “my brother and most beloved son” (S., v. 2, p. 139) is called by name. In the majority of the dialogues, the student and teacher are not named; it is clear, however, that the teacher represents Anselm and presents Anselm’s doctrines. The De Conceptu Virginali and the De Concordia are not written in the same dialogue form as the other treatises, but they are dialogical in their narrative voice(s), since Anselm addresses himself to another person (in the De Conceptu Virginali to Boso), articulating possible problems and objections his reader might make in order to address them.

The dialogue form serves a pedagogical purpose and reflects the project of fides quaerens intellectum, exemplified well by this passage from the De Casu Diaboli: “[L]et it not weary you to briefly reply to my silly questioning [fatuae interrogationi], so that I might know how I should respond to someone asking me the very same thing. Indeed, it is not always easy to respond wisely [sapienter] to someone who is asking foolishly [insipienter].” (S., v. 1, p. 275)

Interestingly, it appears that a recurring problem for Anselm was his treatises being copied and circulated without his authorization and before their final and finished state. He asserts this to be the case with the three connected dialogues and the Cur Deus Homo.

The following sections provide discussions of, and excerpts from, many of Anselm’s key works. With the exception of the ProslogionMonologion, and Cur Deus Homo, the works are examined in chronological order (as best as we know it). These three works are discussed first and in this order because the Proslogion has garnered the most attention from philosophers (more than the earlierMonologion, with which it shares similar aims and content) and the Cur Deus Homo likewise has garnered more attention from theologians than the earlier three dialogues “pertaining to study of Sacred Scripture” (S., v.1, p. 173) (the De VeritateDe Libertate Arbitrii, and De Casu Diaboli).

4. The Proslogion

In the Proslogion, Anselm intended to replace the many interconnected arguments from his previous and much longer work, the Monologion, with a single argument. Since the unum argumentum is supposed to prove not only that God exists, but other matters about God as well, as noted above, there is some scholarly controversy as to exactly what the argument is in the Proslogion’s text. Clearly, the so-called “ontological argument” for God’s existence in Chapter 2 plays a central role. It must be pointed out that Anselm nowhere uses the term “ontological argument,” nor in fact do the critics or proponents of the argument until Kant’s time. It has unfortunately become so ingrained in our philosophical vocabulary, especially in Anglophone Anselm scholarship, however, that it would be pedantic to insist on not using it at all. An interesting and sizable recent literature has developed explicitly contesting the appellation “ontological” applied to Anselm’s Proslogion proof(s) of God’s being or existence, a partial bibliography of which is provided in McEvoy, 1994.

Noting that God is believed to be something than which nothing greater can be thought (quo maius cogitari non potest), Anselm asks whether such a thing exists, since the Fool of the Psalms has said in his heart that there is no God.

But certainly that very same Fool, when he hears this very expression I say [hoc ipsum quod dico]: “something than which nothing greater can be thought,” understands what he hears; and what he understands is in his understanding [in intellectu], even if he does not understand that thing to exist. For it is one thing to be in the understanding, and another to understand a thing to exist. . . . . Therefore even the fool is compelled to admit [convincitur] that there is in his understanding something than which nothing greater can be thought, since when he hears this he understands it, and whatever is understood is in the understanding. And certainly that than which a greater cannot be thought cannot exist in the understanding alone. For if it is in the intellect alone [in solo intellectu], it can be thought to also be in reality [in re], which is something greater. If, therefore, that than which a greater cannot be thought is in the intellect alone, that very thing than which a greater cannot be thought is that than which a greater can be thought. But surely that cannot be. Therefore, without a doubt, something than which a greater cannot be thought exists [exsistit] both in the understanding and in reality. (S., v. 1, p. 101-2)

In Chapter 3, Anselm continues the argumentation, providing what some commentators take to be a second ontological argument.

And, it so truly exists that it cannot be thought not to be. For, a thing, which cannot be thought not to be (which is greater than what cannot be thought not to be), can be thought to be. So, if that than which a greater cannot be thought can be thought not to be, that very thing than which a greater cannot be thought is not that than which a greater cannot be thought, which cannot be compatible [convenire, i.e. with the thing being such]. Therefore, there truly is something than which a greater cannot be thought, and it cannot be thought not to be. (S., p. 102-3)

Addressing himself to God, Anselm explains why God cannot be thought not to exist, indicating why God uniquely has this status. “[I]f some mind could think something better than you, the creature would ascend over the Creator, and would engage in judgment about the Creator, which is quite absurd. And anything else whatsoever other than yourself can be thought not to exist. For you alone are the most true of all things, and thus you have being to the greatest degree [maxime], for anything else is not so truly [as God], and for this reason has less of being.” (S., p. 103) This raises a puzzle, however. Why does the Fool not only doubt whether God exists, but assert that there is no God? One possible, but rather circular answer is provided at the end of Chapter 3. “Why else, except because he is stupid and a fool?” (S., p. 103) As Anselm knows, however, that does not really answer the question. Chapter 4 provides an answer. The Fool both does and does not think [cogitare] that God does not exist, since there are two senses of “think”:

A thing is thought of in one way when one thinks of the word [vox] signifying it, in another way when what the thing itself is is understood. Therefore, in the first way it can be thought that God does not exist, but in the second way not at all. Indeed no one who understands that which God is can think that God is not, even though he says these words in his heart, either without any signification or with some other signification not properly applying to God [aliqua extranea significatione]. (S., p. 103-104)

Proslogion Chapters 5-26 deal progressively with the divine attributes, 5-23 either continuing or building off of the argument, and 24-26 being connected conjectures about God’s goodness. In Chapter 5, Anselm deduces attributes of God from the same “than which nothing greater can be thought” he used in Chapters 2-4.

What then are you, Lord God, that than which nothing greater can be thought? But what are you if not that which is the greatest of all things, who alone exists through himself, who made everything else from nothing? For whatever is not this, is less than what can be thought. But this cannot be thought about you. For what good is lacking to the supreme good, through which every good thing is? And so, you are just, truthful, happy, and whatever it is better to be than not to be. (S., p. 104)

These attributes of God, what it is better to be than not to be, are filled out in Chapter 6 (percipient, omnipotent, merciful, impassible), Chapter 11 (living, wise, good, happy, eternal), and Chapter 18 (an unity).

In Chapter 18, Anselm argues from God’s superlative unity to the unity of his attributes. “[Y]ou are so much a kind of unity [unum quiddam] and identical to yourself, that you are dissimilar to yourself in no way; indeed, you are that very unity, divisible by no understanding. Therefore, life and wisdom and the other [attributes] are not parts of you but all of them are one, and each of them is entirely what you are, and what the other [attributes] are.” (S., p. 115)

In Chapter 23, he employs this notion of superlative unity to explain how God can be a Trinity, indicating that all of the persons of the Trinity share equally and completely in the divine attributes. In the divine unity, the second person of the Trinity, the Son, or the Word is coequal to the first person, “Truly, there cannot be anything other than what you are, or anything greater or lesser than you in the Word by which you speak yourself; for your Word is true [verum] in the same way that you are truthful [quomodo tu verax], and for that reason he is the very same truth as you, not other than you.” (S., p. 117) The same holds for the third person of the Trinity, which is “the one love, common to you and your Son, that is, the Holy Spirit who proceeds from both.” (S., p. 117) Accordingly, for each of the persons of the Trinity, “what any of them is individually is at the same time the entire Trinity, the Father and the Son and the Holy Spirit; for, any one of them individually is not something other than the supremely simple unity and the supremely one simplicity, which cannot be multiplied or be one thing different from another.” (S., p. 117)

There are five other main matters that Anselm addresses in the Proslogion, the first three of which are sets of problems stemming from seeming incompatibilities in the divine attributes. Anselm puts these questions in Chapter 6. “How can you be perceptive [es sensibilis] if you are not a body? How can you be omnipotent, if you cannot do everything? How can you be merciful and impassible at the same time?” (S., p. 104) Anselm deals with the first briefly in Chapter 6, proposing that perceiving is knowing (cognoscere) or aimed at knowing (ad cognoscendum), so that God is supremely perceptive without knowing things through the type of sensibility human beings and animals have.

The argumentation of Chapter 7 is particularly important. There are things that God cannot do, for instance lying, being corrupted, making what is true to be false or what has been done to not be done. It seems that a truly omnipotent being ought to be able to do these things. To be able to do such things, Anselm suggests, is not really to have a power (potentia), but really a kind of powerlessness (impotentia). “For one who can do these things, can do what is not advantageous to oneself and what one ought not do. The more a person can do these things, the more adversity and perversity can do against that person, and the less that person can do against these.” (S., p. 105) So, one who does these things does them through powerlessness, through having one’s agency subjected to that of something other, rather than through one’s power. This, as Anselm explains, relies on an inexact manner of speaking, where one expresses powerlessness or inability as a kind of power or ability

In Chapters 8-11, through a longer and more sustained argument, Anselm answers the third question explaining how God can be both merciful and just at the same time. The explanation rests on God’s mercy stemming from his goodness, which is not ultimately something different from God’s justice, and which can be reconciled with it. Anselm concludes in Chapter 12: “But certainly, whatever you are, you are not through another but through yourself. Accordingly, you are the very life by which you live, and the wisdom by which you are wise, and the goodness by which you are good to good people and bad people; and likewise with similar attributes.” (S., p. 110) For God to be merciful to, forgive, and therefore not render justice to all transgressors, or likewise for God to not extend mercy, forgive, and therefore render justice to all transgressors would be for God to be something lesser than He is. It is, in effect, greater to be able to be just and merciful at the same time, which is possible for God precisely because justice and goodness coincide only in God. At the same time, Anselm concedes that when it comes to understanding precisely why God mercifully forgives of justly rendered judgment in a particular case is beyond our human capacities. For further discussion of Chapters 8-11, cf. Bayart, 1937, Corbin, 1988, and Sadler, 2006.

The fourth main issue, discussed in Chapters 14-17, has to do with our limited knowledge of God, which stems both from human sinfulness and God’s dazzling splendor. Again, as in Chapter 4, one can say that something is and is not the case at the same time, because it is being said in different and distinguishable ways. “If [my soul] did not see you [God], then it did not see the light or the truth. But, is not the truth and the light what it saw and yet did it still not yet see you, since it saw you only in a certain way [aliquatenus] but did not see you exactly as you are [sicuti es]?” (S., p. 111)

The reason the human soul does not see God directly is twofold, stemming both from finite human nature and from infinite divine nature. “But certainly [the human mind] is darkened in itself, and it is dazzled [reverbetur] by you. It is obscured by its own shortness of view [sua brevitate], and it is overwhelmed by your immensity. Truly it is restricted [contrahitur] in by its own narrowness, and it is overcome [vincitur] by your grandeur.” (S., p. 112) For this reason, in Chapter 15, Anselm concludes that God is in fact “greater than can be thought” (maior quam cogitari potest).

Finally, in Chapters 18-21, Anselm discusses God’s eternity. Anselm first indicates that God’s eternity is such that God is entirely present whenever and wherever God is, which is to say everywhere and at all times. Then, in Chapter 19, he begins to articulate the implications of God’s eternity more fully, ultimately leading into a transformation of perspective. Just as it is not the case that there is eternity and God happens to be in and is therefore eternal, since the reality is that God is eternity itself, God is not in every time or place, but rather everything, all times and places, is in God, that is, in God’s eternity.

5. Gaunilo’s Reply and Anselm’s Response

Gaunilo, a monk from the Abbey of Marmoutier, while noting the value of the remainder of theProslogion, attacked its argument for God’s existence on several counts. His arguments prefigure many arguments made by later philosophers against ontological arguments for God’s existence, and Anselm’s responses provide additional insight into the Proslogion argument. Gaunilo makes four main objections, and in each case, Gaunilo transposes Anselm’s “that than which nothing greater can be thought” into “that which is greater than everything else that can be thought.”

Gaunilo asserts that an additional argument is needed to move from this being having been thought to it being impossible for it not to be. “It needs to be proven to me by some other undoubtable argument that this being is of such a sort that as soon as it is thought its undoubtable existence is perceived with certainty by the understanding.” (S., v. 1, p. 126) He brings up this need for a further, unsupplied, argument twice more in his Reply, and in the last instance discusses what is really at issue. The Fool can say: “[W]hen did I say that in the truth of the matter [rei veritate] there was such a thing that is ‘greater than everything?’ For first, by some other completely certain argument, some superior nature must be proven to exist, that is, one greater or better than everything that exists, so that from this we could prove all the other things that cannot be lacking to what is greater or better than everything else.” (S., p. 129)

A second problem is whether one can actually understand what is supposed to be understood in order for the argument to work because God is unlike any creature, anything that we have knowledge or a conception of . “When I hear ‘that which is greater than everything that can be thought,’ which cannot be said to be anything other than God himself, I cannot think it or have it in the intellect on the basis of something I know from its species or genus. . . . For I neither know the thing itself, nor can I form an idea of it from something similar.” (S., p. 126-7)

Gaunilo continues along this line, arguing that the verbal formula employed in the argument is merely that, a verbal formula. The formula cannot really be understood, so it does not then really exist in the understanding. The signification or meaning of the terms can be thought, “but not as by a person who knows what is typically signified by this expression [voce], i.e. by one who thinks it on the basis of a thing that is true at least in thought alone.” (S., p. 127) Instead, what is actually being thought, according to Gaunilo, is vague. The signification or meaning of the terms is grasped only in a groping manner. “[I]t is thought as by one who does not know the thing and simply thinks on the basis of a movement of the mind produced by hearing this expression, trying to picture to himself the meaning of the expression perceived.” (S., p. 127) From this, Gaunilo concludes what he takes to be a denial of one of the premises of the argument: “So much then for the notion that that supreme nature is said to already exist in my understanding.” (S., p. 127)

A third problem that Gaunilo raises is that the argument could be applied to things other than God, things that are clearly imaginary, so that, if the argument were valid, it could be used to prove much more than Anselm intended, namely falsities. Here, the example of the Lost Island is introduced. “You can no longer doubt that this island excelling [praestantiorem] all other lands truly exists somewhere in reality, this island that you do not doubt to exist in your understanding; and since it is more excellent not to be in the understanding alone but also to be in reality, so it is necessary that it exists, since, if it did not, any other land that exists in reality would be more excellent than it.” (S., p. 128)

Anselm’s responses are long, detailed, and dense. Anselm notes Gaunillo’s alteration of the terms of the argument, and that this affects the force of the argument.

You repeat often that I say that, because what is greater than everything else [maius omnibus] is in the understanding, if it is the understanding it is in reality – for otherwise what is greater than everything else would not be greater than everything else – but such a proof [probatio] is found nowhere in all of the things I have said. For, saying “that which is greater than all” and “that than which nothing greater can be thought” do not have the same value for proving that what is being talked about is in reality. (S., p. 134)Therefore if, from what is said to be “greater than everything,” what “that than which nothing greater can be thought” proves of itself through itself [de se per seipsum] cannot be proved in a similar way, you have unjustly criticized me for having said what I did not say, when this differs so much from what I did say. (S., p. 135)

In Anselm’s view, Gaunilo demands a further argument precisely because he has not understood the argument as Anselm presented it. Anselm also affirms that we can understand the meaning of the term, “that than which nothing greater can be thought,” and that it is not simply a verbal formula.

Again, that you say that, when you hear it, you are not able to think or have in your mind “that than which a greater cannot be thought” on the basis of something known from its species or genus, so that you neither know the thing itself, nor can you form an idea of it from something similar. But quite evidently the matter is and remains otherwise [aliter sese habere]. For, every lesser good, insofar as it is good, is similar to a greater good. It is apparent to any reasonable mind that by ascending from lesser goods to greater ones, from those than which something greater can be thought, we are able to infer much [multum. . .conjicere] about that than which nothing greater can be thought. (S., p. 138)

Anselm notes a similarity between the terms “ineffable,” “unthinkable,” and “that than which nothing greater can be thought,” for in each case, it can be impossible for us to think or understand the thing referred to by the expression, but the expression can be thought and understood. Earlier on, Anselm makes a distinction that sheds additional light on this distinction between thinking and understanding the expression, and thinking and understanding the thing referred to by the expression. He also employs a useful metaphor. “[I]f you say that what is not entirely understood is not understood and is not in the understanding: say, then, that since someone is not able to gaze upon the purest light of the sun does not see light that is nothing but sunlight.” (S., p. 132) We do not have to fully and exhaustively understand what a term refers to in order for us to understand the term, and that applies to this case. “Certainly ‘that than which a greater cannot be thought’ is understood and is in the understanding at least to the extent [hactenus] that these things are understood of it.” (S., p. 132)

Anselm also clarifies the scope of his argument, indicating that it applies only to God: “I say confidently that if someone should find for me something existing either in reality or solely in thought, besides ‘that than which a greater cannot be thought,’ to which the schematic framework [conexionem] of my argument could rightly be adapted [aptare valeat], I will find and give him this lost island, nevermore to be lost.” (S., p. 134)

6. The Monologion

This earlier and considerably longer work includes an argument for God’s existence, but also much more discussion of the divine attributes and economy, and some discussion of the human mind. The proof Anselm provides in Chapter 1 is one he considers easiest for a person

who, either because of not hearing or because of not believing, does not know of the one nature, greatest of all things that are, alone sufficient to itself in its eternal beatitude, and who by his omnipotent goodness gives to and makes for all other things that they are something or that in some way they are well [aliquomodo bene sunt], and of the great many other things that we necessarily believe about God or about what he has created. (S., v. 1, p. 13)

The Monologion proof argues from the existence of many good things to a unity of goodness, a one thing through which all other things are good. Anselm first asks whether the diversity of good we experience through our senses and through our mind’s reasoning are all good through one single good thing, or whether there are different and multiple good things through which they are good. He recognizes, of course, that there are a variety of ways for things to be good things, and he also recognizes that many things are in fact good through other things. But, he is pushing the question further, since for every good thing B through which another good thing A is good, one can still ask what that good thing B is good through. If goods can even be comparable as goods, there must be some more general and unified way of regarding their goodness, or that through which they are good. Anselm argues: “you are not accustomed to considering something good except on an account of some usefulness, as health and those things that conduce to health are said to be good [propter aliquam utilitatem], or because of being of intrinsic value in some way [propter quamlibet honestatem], just as beauty and things that contribute to beauty are esteemed to be a good.” (S., p. 14)

This being granted, usefulness and intrinsic values can be brought to a more general unity. “It is necessary, for all useful or intrinsically valuable things, if they are indeed good things, that they are good through this very thing, through which all goods altogether [cuncta bona] must exist, whatever this thing might be.” (S., p. 14-5) This good alone is good through itself. All other good things are ultimately good through this thing, which is the superlative or supreme good. Certain corollaries can be drawn from this. One is that all good things are not only good through this Supreme Good; they are good, that is to say they have their being from the Supreme Good. Another is that “what is supremely good [summe bonum] is also supremely great [summe magnum]. Accordingly, there is one thing that is supremely good and supremely great, i.e. the highest [summum] of all things that are.” (S., p. 15) In Chapter 2, Anselm clarifies what he means by “great,” making a point that will assume greater importance in Chapter 15: “But, I am speaking about ‘great’ not with respect to physical space [spatio], as if it is some body, but rather about things that are greater [maius] to the degree that they are better [melius] or more worthy [dignus], for instance wisdom.” (S., p. 15)

Chapter 3 provides further discussion of the ontological dependence of all beings on this being. For any thing that is or exists, there must be something through which it is or exists. “For, everything that is, either is through [per] something or through nothing. But nothing is through nothing. For, it cannot be thought [non. . .cogitari potest] that something should be but not through something. So, whatever is, only is through something.” (S., p. 15-6) Anselm considers and rejects several possible ways of explaining how it is that all things are. There could be one single being through which all things have their being. Or there could be a plurality of beings through which other beings have their being. The second possibility allows three cases: “[I]f they are multiple, then either: 1) they are referred to some single thing through which they are, or 2) they are, individually [singula], through themselves [per se], or 3) they are mutually through each other [per se invicem].” (S., p. 16)

In the first case, they are all through one single being. In the second case, there is still some single power or nature of existing through oneself [existendi per se], common to all of them. Saying that they exist through themselves really means that they exist through this power or nature which they share. Again, they have one single ontological ground upon which they are dependent. One can propose the third case, but it is upon closer consideration absurd. “Reason does not allow that there would be many things [that have their being] mutually through each other, since it is an irrational thought that some thing should be through another thing, to which the first thing gives its being.” (S., p. 16)

For Anselm three things follow from this. First, there is a single being through which all other beings have their being. Second, this being must have its being through itself. Third, in the gradations of being, this being is to the greatest degree.

Whatever is through something else is less than that through which everything else together is, and that which alone is through itself. . . . So, there is one thing that alone, of all things, is, to the greatest degree and supremely [maxime et summe]. For, what of all things is to the greatest degree, and through which anything else is good or great, and through which anything else is something, necessarily that thing is supremely good and supremely great and the highest of all things that are. (S., p. 16)

Chapter 4 continues this discussion of degrees. In the nature of things, there are varying degrees (gradus) of dignity or worth (dignitas). The example Anselm uses is humorous and indicates an important feature of the human rational mind, namely its capacity to grasp these different degrees of worth. “For, one who doubts whether a horse in its nature is better than a piece of wood, and that a human being is superior to a horse, that person assuredly does not deserve to be called a human being.” (S., p. 17) Anselm argues that there must be a highest nature, or rather a nature that does not have a superior, otherwise the gradations would be infinite and unbounded, which he considers absurd. By argumentation similar to that of the previous chapters, he adduces that there can only be one such highest nature. The scale of gradations comes up again later in Chapter 31, where he indicates that creatures’ degrees of being, and being superior to other creatures, depends on their degree of likeness to God (specifically to the divine Word).

[E]very understanding judges natures in any way living to be superior to non-living ones, sentient natures to be superior to non-sentient ones, rational ones to be superior to irrational ones. For since the Supreme Nature, in its own unique manner, not only is but also lives and perceives and is rational, it is clear that. . . what in any way is living is more alike to the Supreme Nature than that which does not in any way live; and, what in any way, even by bodily sense, knows something is more like the Supreme Nature than what does not perceive at all; and, what is rational is more like the Supreme Nature than what is not capable of reason. (S., p. 49)

Through something akin to what analytic philosophers might term a thought-experiment and phenomenologists an eidetic variation, Anselm considers a being gradually stripped of reason, sentience, life, and then the “bare being” (nudum esse) that would be left: “[T]his substance would be in this way bit by bit destroyed, led by degrees (gradatim) to less and less being, and finally to non-being. And, those things that, when they are taken away [absumpta] one by one from some essence, reduce it to less and less being, when they are reassumed [assumpta] . . . lead it to greater and greater being.” (S., p. 49-50)

In the chapters that follow, Anselm indicates that the Supreme Nature derives its existence only from itself, meaning that it was never brought into existence by something else. Anselm uses an analogy to suggest how the being of the Supreme Being can be understood.

Therefore in what way it should be understood [intelligenda est] to be through itself and from itself [per se et ex se], if it does not make itself, not arise as its own matter, nor in any way help itself to be what it was not before?. . . .In the way “light” [lux] and “to light” [lucere] and “lighting” [lucens] are related to each other [sese habent ad invicem], so are “essence” [essentia] and “to be” [esse] and “being,” i.e. supremely existing or supremely subsisting. (S., p. 20)

This Supreme Nature is that through which all things have their being precisely because it is the Creator, which creates all beings (including the matter of created beings) ex nihilo.

In Chapters 8-14, the argument shifts direction, leading ultimately to a restatement of the traditional Christian doctrine of the Logos (the “Word” of God, the Son of the Father and Creator). The argumentation starts by examination of the meaning of “nothing,” distinguishing different senses and uses of the term. Creation ex nihilo could be interpreted three different ways. According to the first way, “what is said to have been made from nothing has not been made at all.” (S., p. 23) In another way, “something was said to be made from nothing in this way, that it was made from this very nothing, that is from that which is not; as if this nothing were something existing, from which something could be made.” (S., p. 23) Finally, there is a “third interpretation. . . when we understand something to be made but that there is not something from which it has been made.” (S., p. 23)

The first way, Anselm says, cannot be properly applied to anything that actually has been made, and the second way is simply false, so the third way or sense is the correct interpretation. In Chapter 9, an important implication of creation ex nihilo is drawn out “There is no way that something could come to be rationally from another, unless something preceded the thing to be made in the maker’s reason as a model, or to put it better a form, or a likeness, or a rule.” (S., p. 24) This, in turn implies another important doctrine: “what things were going to be, or what kinds of things or how the things would be, were in the supreme nature’s reason before everything came to be.” (S., p. 24) In subsequent chapters, the doctrine is further elaborated, culminating in this pattern being the utterance (locutio) of the supreme essence and the supreme essence, that is to say the Word (verbum) of the Father, while being of the same substance as the Father.

Chapter 15-28 examine, discuss, and argue for particular attributes of God, 15-17 and 28 being of particular interest. Chapter 15 is devoted to the matter of what can be said about the divine substance. Relative terms do not really communicate the essence of the divine being, even including expressions such as “the highest of all” (summa omnium) or “greater than everything that has been created by it” (maior omnibus . . .) “For if none of those things ever existed, in relation to which [God] is called “the highest” and “greater,” it would be understood to be neither the highest nor greater. But still, it would be no less good on that account, nor would it suffer any loss of the greatness of its essence. And this is obvious, for this reason: whatever may be good or great, this thing is not such through another but by its very self.” (S., p. 28)

There are still other ways of talking about the divine substance. One way is to say that the divine substance is “whatever is in general [omnino] better that what is not it. For, it alone is that than which nothing is better, and that which is better than everything else that is not what it is.” (S., p. 29) Given that explanation, while there are some things that it is better for certain beings to be rather than not to be, God will not be those things, but only what it is absolutely better to be than not to be. So, for instance, God will not be a body, but God will be wise or just. Anselm provides a partial listing of the qualities or attributes that do express the divine essence: “living, wise, powerful and all-powerful, true, just, happy, eternal, and whatever in like wise it is absolutely better to be than not to be.” (S., p. 29)

Anselm raises a problem in Chapter 16. Granted that God has these attributes, one might think that all that is being signified is that God is a being that has these attributes to a greater degree than other beings, not what God is. Anselm uses justice as the example, which is fitting since it is usually conceived of as something relational. Anselm first sets out the problem in terms of participation in qualities. “[E]verything that is just is just through justice, and similarly for other things of this sort. Accordingly, that very supreme nature is not just unless through justice. So, it appears that by participation in the quality, namely justice, the supremely good substance can be called just.” (S., p. 30) And this reasoning leads to the conclusion that the supremely good substance “is just through another, and not through itself.” (S., p. 30)

The problem is that God is what he is through himself, while other things are what they are through him. In the case of each divine attribute, as in the later Proslogion, God having that attribute is precisely that attribute itself, so that for instance, God is not just by some standard or idea of justice extrinsic to God himself, but rather God is God’s own justice, and justice in the superlative sense. Everything else canhave the attribute of justice, whereas God is justice. This argument can be extended to all of God’s attributes What is perceived to have been settled in the case of justice, the intellect is constrained by reason to judge [sentire] to be the case about everything that is said in a similar way about that supreme nature. Whichever of them, then, is said about the supreme nature, it is not how [qualis] nor how much [quanta] [the supreme nature has quality] that is shown [monstratur] but rather what it is. . . .Thus, it is the supreme essence, supreme life, supreme reason, supreme salvation [salus], supreme justice, supreme wisdom, supreme truth, supreme goodness, supreme greatness, supreme beauty, supreme immortality, supreme incorruptibility, supreme immutability, supreme happiness, supreme eternity, supreme power [potestas], supreme unity, which is nothing other than supreme being, supremely living, and other things in like wise [similiter]. (S., p. 30-1)

This immediately raises yet another problem, however, because this seems like a multiplicity of supreme attributes, implying that each is a particularly superlative way of being for God, suggesting that God is in some manner a composite. Instead, in God (not in any other being) each of these is all of the others. God’s being alone, as Chapter 28 argues, is being in an unqualified sense. All other beings, since they are mutable, or because they can be understood to have come from non-being, “barely (vix) exist or almost (fere) do not exist.” (S., p. 46)

Chapters 29-48 continue the investigation of the generation of the “utterance” or Word, the Son, from the Father in the divine economy, and 49-63 expand this to discussion of the love between the Father and the Son, namely the Holy Spirit, equally God as the Father and Son. 64-80 discuss the human creature’s grasp and understanding of God. Chapter 31 is of particular interest, and discusses the relationship between words or thoughts in human minds and the Word or Son by which all things were created by the Father. A human mind contains images or likenesses of things that are thought of or talked about, and a likeness is true to the degree that it imitates more or less the thing of which it is likeness, so that the thing has a priority in truth and in being over the human subject apprehending it, or more properly speaking, over the image, idea, or likeness by which the human subject apprehends the thing. In the Word, however, there are not likenesses or images of the created things, but instead, the created things are themselves imitations of their true essences in the Word.

The discussion in Chapters 64-80, which concludes the Monologion, makes three central points. First, the triune God is ineffable, and except in certain respects incomprehensible, but we can arrive at this conclusion and understand it to some degree through reason. This is because our arguments and investigations do not attain the distinctive character (proprietatem) of God. That does not present an insurmountable problem, however.

For often we talk about many things that we do not express properly, exactly as they really are, but we signify through another thing what we will not or can not bring forth properly, as for instance when we speak in riddles. And often we see something, not properly, exactly how the thing is, but through some likeness or image, for instance when we look upon somebody’s face in a mirror. Indeed, in this way we talk about and do not talk about, see and do not see, the same thing. We talk about it and see it through something else; we do not talk about it and see it through its distinctive character [proprietatem]Now, whatever names seem to be able to be said of this nature, they do not so much reveal it to me through its distinctive character as signify it [innuunt] to me through some likeness. (S., v. 1, p. 76)

Anselm uses the example of the divine attribute of wisdom. “For the name ‘wisdom’ is not sufficient to reveal to me that being through which all things were made from nothing and preserved from [falling into] nothing.” (S., p. 76)

The outcome of this is that all human thought and knowledge about God is mediated through something. Likenesses are never the thing of which they are a likeness, but there are greater and lesser degrees of likeness. This leads to the second point. Human beings come closer to knowing God through investigating what is closer to him, namely the rational mind, which is a mirror both of itself and, albeit in a diminished way, of God.

[J]ust as the rational mind alone among all other creatures is able to rise to the investigation of this Being, likewise it is no less alone that through which the rational mind itself can make progress towards investigation of that Being. For we have already come to know [jam cognitum est] that the rational mind, through the likeness of natural essence, most approaches that Being. What then is more evident than that the more assiduously the rational mind directs itself to learning about itself, the more effectively it ascends to the knowledge [cognitionem] of that Being, and that the more carelessly it looks upon itself, the more it descends from the exploration [speculatione] of that Being? (S., v. 1, p. 77)

Third, to be truly rational involves loving and seeking God, which in fact requires an effort to remember and understand God. “[I]t is clear that the rational creature ought to expend all of its capacity and willing [suum posse et velle] on remembering and understanding and loving the Supreme Good, for which purpose it knows itself to have its own being.” (S., p. 79)

7. Cur Deus Homo

The Monologion and Proslogion (although often only Chapters 2-4 of the latter) are typically studied by philosophers. The Cur Deus Homo (Why God Became Man) is more frequently studied by theologians, particularly since Anselm’s interpretation of the Atonement has been influential in Christian theology. The method, however, as in his other works, is primarily a philosophical one, attempting to understand truths of the Christian faith through the use of reasoning, granted of course, that this reasoning is applied to theological concepts. Anselm provides a twofold justification for the treatise, both responding to requests “by speech and by letter.” The first is for those asking Anselm to discuss the Incarnation, providing rational accounts (rationes) “not so that through reason they attain to faith, but so that they may delight in the understanding and contemplation of those things they believe, and so that they might be, as much as possible, 'always ready to satisfy all those asking with an account [rationem] for those things for which' we 'hope.'” (S., v. 2, p. 48)

The second is for those same people, but so that they can engage in argument with non-Christians. As Anselm says, non-believers make the question of the Incarnation a crux in their arguments against Christianity, “ridiculing Christian simplicity as foolishness, and many faithful are accustomed to turn it over in their hearts.” (S., p. 48) The question simply stated is this: “by what reason or necessity was God made man, and by his death, as we believe and confess, gave back life to the world, when he could have done this either through another person, either human or angelic, or through his will alone?” (S., p. 48)

In Chapter 3, Anselm’s interlocutor, his fellow monk and student Boso, raises several specific objections made by non-Christians to the Christian doctrine of the Incarnation: “we do injustice and show contempt [contumeliam] to God when we affirm that he descended into a woman’s womb, and that he was born of woman, that he grew nourished by milk and human food, and – so that I can pass over many other things that do not seem befitting to God– that he endured weariness, hunger, thirst, lashes, and the cross and death between thieves.” (S., v. 2, p. 51)

Anselm’s immediate response mirrors the structure of the Cur Deus Homo. Each of the points he makes are argued in fuller detail later in the work.

For it was fitting that, just as death entered into the human race by man’s disobedience, so should life be restored by man’s obedience. And, that, just as the sin that was the cause of our damnation had its beginning from woman, so the author of our justice and salvation should be born from woman. And, that the devil conquered man through persuading him to taste from the tree [ligni], should be conquered by man through the passion he endured on the tree [ligni]. (S., p. 51)

The first book (Chapters 1-25), produces a lengthy argument, involving a number of distinctions, discussions about the propriety of certain expressions and the entailments of willing certain things. Chapters 16-19 represent a lengthy digression involving questions about the number of angels who fell or rebelled against God, whether their number is to be made up of good humans, and related questions. The three most important parts of the argument take the form of these discussions: the justice and injustice of God, humans, and the devil; the entailments of the Father and the Son willing the redemption of humanity; the inability of humans to repay God for their sins.

Anselm distinguishes, as he does in the earlier treatise De Veritate, different ways in which an action or state can be just or unjust, specifically just and unjust at the same time, but not in the same way of looking at the matter. “For, it happens sometimes [contingit] that the same thing is just and unjust considered from different viewpoints [diversis considerationibus], and for this reason it is adjudged to be entirely just or entirely unjust by those who do not look at it carefully.” (S., p. 57) Humans are justly punished by God for sin, and they are justly tormented by the devil, but the devil unjustly torments humans, even though it is just for God to allow this to take place.“In this way, the devil is said to torment a man justly, because God justly permits this and the man justly suffers it. But, because a man is said to justly suffer, one does not mean that he justly suffers because of his own justice, but because he is punished by God’s just judgment.” (S., p. 57)

Not only distinguishing between different ways of looking at the same matter is needed, but also distinguishing between what is directly willed and what is entailed in willing certain things. On first glance, it could seem that God the Father directly wills the death of Jesus Christ, God the Son, or that the latter wills his own death. Indeed something like this has to be the case, because God does will the redemption of humanity, and this comes through the Incarnation and through Christ’s death and resurrection. According to Anselm, Christ dies as an entailment of what it is that God wills. “For, if we intend to do something, but propose to do something else first through which the other thing will be done, when what we chose to be first is done, if what we intend comes to be, it is correctly said to be done on account of the other…” (S., p. 62-3) Accordingly, what God willed (as both Father and Son) was the redemption of the human race, which required the death of Christ, and required this “not because the Father preferred the death of the Son over his life, but because the Father was not willing to restore the human race unless man did something as great as that death of Christ was.” (S., p. 63) As Anselm goes on to explain, the determination of the Son’s will then takes place within the structure of the Father’s will. “Since reason did not demand that another person do what he could not, for that reason the Son says that he wills his own death, which he preferred to suffer rather than that the human race not be saved.” (S., p. 63-4) What was involved in Christ’s death, therefore, was actually obedience on the part of the Son, following out precisely what was entailed by God’s willing to redeem humanity. The central point of the argument is then making clear why the redemption of humanity would have to involve the death of Christ. Articulating this, Anselm begins by discussing sin in terms of what is due or owed to (quod debet) God.

Sin is precisely not giving God what is due to him, namely: “[e]very willing [voluntas] of a rational creature should [debet] be subject to God’s will.” (S., p. 68) Doing this is justice or rightness of will, and is the “sole and complete debt of honor” (solus et totus honor), which is owed to God. Now, sin, understood as disobedience and contempt or dishonor, is not as simple, nor as simple to remedy, as it first appears. In the sinful act or volition, which already requires its own compensation, there is an added sin against God’s honor, which requires additional compensation. “But, so long as he does not pay for [solvit] what he has wrongly taken [rapuit], he remains in fault. Nor does it suffice simply to give back what was taken away, but for the contempt shown [pro contumelia illata] he ought to give back more than he took away.” (S., p. 68)

Anselm provides analogous examples: one endangering another’s safety ought to restore the safety, but also compensate for the anguish (illata doloris iniuria recompenset); violating somebody’s honor requires not only honoring the person again, but also making recompense in some other way; unjust gains should be recompensed not only by returning the unjust gain, but also by something that could not have otherwise been demanded.

The question then is whether it would be right for God to simply forgive humans sins out of mercy (misericordia), and the answer is that this would be unbefitting to God, precisely because it would contravene justice. It is really impossible, however, for humans to make recompense or satisfaction, that is to say, satisfy the demands of justice, for their sins. One reason for this is that one already owes whatever one would give God at any given moment. Boso suggests numerous possible recompenses: “[p]enitence, a contrite and humbled heart, abstinence and bodily labors of many kinds, and mercy in giving and forgiving, and obedience.” (S., p. 68)

Anselm responds, however: “When you give to God something that you owe him, even if you do not sin, you ought not reckon this as the debt that you own him for sin. For, you owe all of these things you mention to God.” (S., p. 68) Strict justice requires that a human being make satisfaction for sin, satisfaction that is humanly impossible. Absent this satisfaction, God forgiving the sin would violate strict justice, in the process contravening the supreme justice that is God. A human being is doubly bound by the guilt of sin, and is therefore “inexcusable” having “freely [sponte] obligated himself by that debt that he cannot pay off, and by his fault cast himself down into this impotency, so that neither can he pay back what he owed before sinning, namely not sinning, nor can he pay back what he owes because he sinned.” (S., p. 92)

Accordingly, humans must be redeemed through Jesus Christ, who is both man and God, the argument for which comes in Book II, starting in Chapter 6, and elaborated through the remainder of the treatise, which also treats subsidiary problems. The argument at its core is that only a human being can make recompense for human sin against God, but this being impossible for any human being, such recompense could only be made by God. This is only possible for Jesus Christ, the Son, who is both God and man, with (following the Chalcedonian doctrine) two natures united but distinct in the same person (Chapter7). The atonement is brought about by Christ’s death, which is of infinite value, greater than all created being (Chapter 14), and even redeems the sins of those who killed Christ (Chapter 15). Ultimately, in Anselm’s interpretation of the atonement, divine justice and divine mercy in the fullest senses are shown to be entirely compatible.

8. De Grammatico

This dialogue stands on its own in the Anselmian corpus, and focuses on untangling some puzzles about language, qualities, and substances. Anselm’s solutions to the puzzles involve making needed distinctions at proper points, and making explicit what particular expressions are meant to express. The dialogue ends with the puzzles resolved, but also with Anselm signaling the provisional status of the conclusions reached in the course of investigation. He cautions the student: “Since I know how much the dialecticians in our times dispute about the question you brought forth, I do not want you to stick to the points we made so that you would hold them obstinately if someone were to be able to destroy them by more powerful arguments and set up others.” (S., v. 1, p.168)

The student begins by asking whether “expert in grammar” (grammaticus) is a substance or a quality. The question, and the discussion, has a wider scope, however, since once that is known, “I will recognize what I ought to think about other things that are similarly spoken of through derivation [denominative].” (S., p.144)

There is a puzzle about the term “expert in grammar,” and other like terms, because a case, or rather an argument, can be made for either option, meaning it can be construed to be a substance or a quality. The student brings forth the argument.

That every expert in grammar is a man, and that every man is a substance, suffice to prove that expert in grammar is a substance. For, whatever the expert in grammar has that substance would follow from, he has only from the fact that he is a man. So, once it is conceded that he is a man, whatever follows from being a man follows from being an expert in grammar. (S., v. 1, p.144-5)

At the same time, philosophers who have dealt with the subject have maintained that it is a quality, and their authority is not to be lightly disregarded. So, there is a serious and genuine problem. The term must signify either a substance or a quality, and cannot do both. One option must be true and the other false, but since there are arguments to be made for either side, it is difficult to tell which one is false.

The teacher responds by pointing out that the options are not necessarily incompatible with each other. Before explaining how this can be so, he asks the student to lay out the objections against both options. The student begins by attacking the premise “expert in grammar is a man” (grammaticum esse hominem) with two arguments

No expert in grammar can be understood [intelligi] without reference to grammar, and every man can be understood without reference to grammar.Every expert in grammar admits of [being] more and less, and No man admits of [being] more or less From either one of these linkings [contextione] of two propositions one conclusion follows, i.e. no expert in grammar is a man. (S., p.146)

The teacher states, however, that this conclusion does not follow from the premises, and uses a similar argument to illustrate his point. The term “animal” signifies “animate substance capable of perception,” which can be understood without reference to rationality. The teacher then gets the student to admit to a further proposition, “every animal can be understood without reference to rationality, and no animal is from necessity rational,” to which he adds: “But no man can be understood without reference to rationality, and it is necessary that every man be rational.” (S., p.147) The implication, which the student sees and would like to avoid, is the clearly false conclusion, “no man is an animal.” On the other hand, the student does not want to give up the connection between man and rationality.

The teacher indicates a way out of the predicament by noting that the false conclusions are arrived at by inferring from the premises in a mechanical way, without examining what is in fact being expressed by the premises, without making proper distinctions based on what is being expressed, and without restating the premises as propositions more adequately expressing what the premises are supposed to assert. The teacher begins by asking the student to make explicit what the man, and the expert in grammar, are being understood as with or without reference to grammar. This allows the premises in the student’s arguments to be more adequately restated.

Every man can be understood as man without reference to grammar. No expert in grammar can be understood as expert in grammar without reference to grammar.No man is more or less man, and Every expert in grammar is more or less an expert in grammar. (S., v. 1, p.148-9)

In both cases, it is now apparent that where it seemed previously there was a common term, and therefore a valid syllogism, there is in fact no common term. This does not mean that nothing can be validly inferred from them. But, in order for something to be validly inferred, a common term must be found. The teacher advises: “The common term of a syllogism should be not so much in the expression brought forward [in prolatione] as in meaning [in sententia].” (S., p.149) The reasoning behind this is that what “binds the syllogism together” is the meaning of the terms used, not the mere words, “For just as nothing is accomplished if the term is common in language [in voce] but not in meaning [in sensu], likewise nothing impedes us if it is in our understanding [in intellectu] but not in the expression brought forward [in prolatione].” (S., p.149)

The first set of premises of the of the student’s double argument can be reformulated then as the following new premises.

To be a man does not require grammar, and
To be an expert in grammar requires grammar. (S., p.149)

Thus restated, the premises do have a common term, and a conclusion can be inferred from them namely: “To be an expert in grammar is not to be a man, i.e., there is not the same definition for both of them.” (S., p.149) What this conclusion means is not that an expert in grammar is not a man, but rather that they are not identical, they do not have the same definition. Other syllogisms, appearing at first glance valid but terminating in false conclusions, can similarly be transformed. One that deals directly with the student’s initial question runs:

Every expert in grammar is spoken of as a quality [in eo quod quale].
No man is spoken of as a quality.
Thus, no man is an expert in grammar. (S., p.150)

The premises can be reformulated according to their meaning:

Every expert in grammar is spoken of as expert in grammar as a quality.
No man is spoken of as man as a quality. (S., p.150)

It is now apparent that again there is no middle term, and the conclusion does not validly follow. The student explores various possible syllogisms that might be constructed before the teacher indicates that the student, who ends with the conclusion, “the essence of man is not the essence of expert in grammar,” (S., p.150) has not fully grasped the lesson. The teacher brings in a further distinction, that of respect or manner (modo). This requires attention to what is actually being signified by the expressions “man,” and “expert in grammar.” An expert in grammar, who is a man, can be understood as a man without reference to grammar, so in some respect an expert in grammar can be understood without reference to grammar (that is, understood as man, not as an expert in grammar, which he nonetheless still is). And, a man, who is an expert in grammar, who is to be understood as an expert in grammar, cannot be so understood without reference to grammar.

Another puzzle can be raised about man and expert in grammar, bearing on being present in a subject. An argument clearly going against Aristotle’s intentions can be derived by using one of his statements as a premise.

Expert in grammar is among those things that are in a subject.
And, no man is in a subject.
So, no expert in grammar is a man. (S., p.154)

The teacher again directs the student to pay close attention to the meaning of what is being said. When one speaks about an “expert in grammar,” the things that are signified are “man” and “grammar.” Man is a substance, and is not present in a subject, but grammar is a quality and is present in a subject. So, depending on what way one looks at it, someone can say that expert in grammar is a substance and is not in a subject, if they mean “expert in grammar” insofar as the expert in grammar is a man (secundum hominem). Alternately, one can say that expert in grammar is a quality and is in a subject, if they mean “expert in grammar” with respect to grammar (secundum grammaticam). Similarly, “expert in grammar” can be regarded, from different points of view, as being primary or secondary substance, or as neither.

“Expert in grammar” has been shown to be able to be both a substance and a quality, so that there is no inconsistency between them. The student then raises a related problem, asking why “man” cannot similarly be a substance and a quality. “For man signifies a substance along with all those differentia that are in man, such as sensibility and mortality.” (S., p.156) The teacher points out that the case of “man” is not similar to that of “expert in grammar.” “[Y]ou do not consider how dissimilarly the name ‘man’ signifies those things of which a man consists, and how expert in grammar [signifies] man and grammar. Truly, the name ‘man’ signifies by itself and as one thing those things of which the entire man consists.” (S., p.156)

“Expert in grammar,” however, signifies “man” and “grammar” in different ways. It signifies “grammar” by itself (per se); it signifies “man” by something else (per aliud). Expertise in grammar is an accident of man, so “expert in grammar” cannot signify “man” in any unconditioned sense, but rather is something said of man (appellative hominis). The man is the underlying substance in which there can be grammar, and the underlying substance can be expert in grammar.

So, “expert in grammar” can rightly be understood in accordance with Aristotle’s Categories as a quality, because it signifies a quality. At the same time, “expert in grammar” is said of a substance, that is to say, man. This still raises some problems in the mind of the student, who suggests “expert in grammar” could be a having, or under the category of having, and asks whether a single thing can be of several categories. The teacher, conceding that the issue requires further study, maintains, directing the student through several examples, that a single expression that signifies more than one thing can be in more than one category, provided the things that are signified are not signified as actually one thing.

9. The De Veritate

This dialogue, which Anselm describes in its preface as one of “three treatises pertaining to the study of Sacred Scripture,” dealing with “what truth is, in what things [quibus rebus] truth is customarily said to be, and what justice is” (S., v. 1, p. 173), begins with a student asking for a definition of truth. The dialogical lesson takes the truth of statements as a starting point. A statement is true “[w]hen what it states [quod enuntiat], whether in affirming or in negating, is so [est].” (S., v. 1, p. 177) Given this, Anselm’s theory of truth appears at first glance a simple correspondence theory, where truth consists in the correspondence between statements and states of affairs signified by those statements.

His theory is more complex, however, and relies on a Platonic notion of participation, or more accurately stated, weds together a correspondence theory with a Platonic participational view. “[N]othing is true except by participating in truth; and so the truth of the true thing is in the true thing itself. But truly the thing stated is not in the true statement. So, it [the thing stated] should not be called its truth, but the cause of its truth. For this reason it seems to me that the truth of the statement should be sought only in the language itself [ipsa oratione].” (S., v. 1, p. 177) It is very important at this point to keep in mind that Anselm is not saying that all truth is simply in language, but rather that the truth of statements, truth of signification, lies in the language used. The truth of the statement cannot be the statement itself, nor can it be the statement’s signifying, nor the statement’s “definition,” for in any of these cases, the statement would always be true. Instead, statements are true when they signify correctly or rightly, and Anselm provides the key term for his larger theory of truth, “rectitude” or “rightness.” “Therefore its [an affirmation’s] truth is not something different than rightness [rectitudo].” (S., p. 178)

Anselm notes, however, that even when a statement affirms that what-is-not is, or vice versa, there is stillsome truth or correctness to the statement. This is so because there are two kinds of truth in signifying, for a statement can signify that what is the case is the case, and it does signify what it signifies. “There is one rightness and truth of the statement because it signifies what it was made to signify [ad quod significandum facta est]; and, there is another, when it signifies that which it received the capacity to signify [quod accepit significare].” (S., p. 179)

Accordingly, for Anselm, the truth of statements consists in part in the correspondence of the statement to the state of affairs signified, but also in the signification itself, the sense or meaning of the statement. “It always possesses the latter kind of truth, but does not always possess the former. For, it has the latter kind naturally, but the former kind accidentally and according to usage.” (S., p.179) For example, the expression “it is day” always possesses the second kind of truth, since the expression can always signify what it does signify; in other words, it can convey a meaning. But, whether or not it possesses the first kind of truth depends on whether in fact it is day. According to Anselm, in certain statements, the two kinds of truth or correctness are inseparable from each other, examples of these being universal statements, such as “man is an animal.”

He goes on to discuss truth of other kinds, in thought, in the will, in action, in the senses, and in the being of things. Truth in thought is analogous to truth in signification, but Anselm discusses only the first kind of truth, where thoughts correspond to actual states of affairs, this being “rightness” of thought. Truth in the will likewise consists in rightness, in other words, willing what it is that one ought to will. With respect to actions, again truth is rightness, in this case goodness. “To do good [bene facere] and to do evil [male facere] are contraries. For this reason, if to do the truth [veritatem facere] and to do good are the same in opposition, they are not different in their signification. . . . [T]o do what is right [rectitudinem facere] is to do the truth… Nothing is more apparent then than that the truth of an action is its rightness.” (S., p. 182)

But Anselm distinguishes between natural actions, such as a fire heating, which are non-rational and necessary, and non-natural actions, such as giving alms, which are rational and non-necessary. The natural type is always true, like the second kind of truth in signification. The non-natural type is sometimes true, sometimes false, like the first kind of truth in signification. Truth of the senses, Anselm argues, is a misnomer, as the truth or falsity involving the senses is not in the senses but in the “judgment” (in opinione). “The inner sense itself makes an error [se fallit], rather than the exterior sense lying to it.” (S., p. 183)

Speaking of the second kind of truth in signification, and of the truth of natural actions involves reference to a “Supreme Truth,” namely, God. Everything that is, insofar as it is receives its being [quod est] from the Supreme Truth. An argument, placed in the mouth of the dialogue’s teacher, follows from this: 1) “If all things are this, i.e. what they are there [in the Supreme Truth], without a doubt they are what they ought to be.” 2) “But whatever is what it ought to be is rightly [recte est]. “Thus, everything that is, is rightly.” (S, p. 185)

This, however, seems to present a genuine and serious problem, given the existence and experience of evil, specifically, “many deeds done evilly” (multa opera male), in the world as we know it. In order to address this, Anselm resorts to the traditional distinction between God causing and God permitting evil. Evil actions and evil willing ought not to be, but what happens when God permits it, because He permits it, ought to be. The solution to this puzzle lies in further distinction. “For in many ways the same matter [eadem res] supports opposites when considered from different perspectives [diversis considerationibus]. This often happens to be the case for an action. . . .” (S., p. 187)

Anselm uses the example of a “beating” (percussio), which can be regarded both as an action, on the part of the agent, and as a passion, on the part of the passive sufferer. Both the active and the passive are necessarily connected. “For a beating is of the one acting and of the one suffering, whence it can be said of either the action [giving a beating] and the passion [getting a beating].” (S., p. 187) While these two are necessarily connected, the same is not true of the judgments that can be made regarding each side of the action, for instance the rightness of the action or the suffering. A person might be rightly beaten, but it may be wrong for this or that person to give the beating. The implication of this is that “it can happen that according to nature an action or a passion should be, but in respect to the person acting or the person suffering should not be, since neither should the former do it nor the latter suffer it.” (S., p. 188) In this case, and other similar cases, it is possible for the same thing to have seemingly contradictory determinations. The key here, however, is that the same thing is being “considered from different perspectives [diversis considerationibus]” (S., p. 188)

Anselm then brings all of the other kinds of truth back to the truth of signification, not reducing them all to signification, but rather indicating how they are connected to each other. “For, there is true or false signification not only in those things we are accustomed to call signs but also in all of the other things that we have spoken of. For, since something should not be done by someone unless it is something that someone should do, by the very fact that someone does something, he says and he signifies that he ought to do that thing.” (S., p. 189) In every action, according to this doctrine, there is an implicit assertion of truth being made (rightly or wrongly) by the agent. For example, an expert tells a non-expert that certain herbs are non-poisonous, but avoids eating them, his action’s (true) signification being more trustworthy than his (false) signification in his statement. This applies even further.

So likewise, if you did not know that one ought not to lie and somebody lied in your presence, then even if he were to tell you that he himself ought not to lie, he would himself tell you more by his deed [opere] that he ought to lie than by his words that he ought not [to lie]. Similarly, when somebody thinks of or wills something, if you did not know whether he ought to will or think of that thing, and if you could see his willing or his thought, he would signify to you by that very action [ipso opere] that he ought to think about and will that thing. And, if he did ought to do so, he would speak the truth. But if not, he would lie. (S., p. 189)

In Anselm’s parlance, it is possible for action, willing, and thinking to be false, in other words, to be lies on the part of the acting, willing, or thinking subject. This involves a reference, noted earlier, to the Supreme Truth, God, more specifically to the truth of the being of things as they are in the Supreme Truth. All of the types of truth or rightness are ultimately determined or conditioned by the Supreme Truth, which is “the cause of all other truths and rightnesses.” Some of these other truths are themselves in turn causes as well as effects, while others are simply effects. “Since the truth that is in the existence of things is an effect of the Supreme Truth, this is also the cause of the truth belonging to thoughts and the truth that is in propositions; but these two truths are not the cause of any truth.” (S., p. 189)

After having carried out these dialogic investigations of the various kinds of truth, Anselm is now ready to provide a definition: “Accordingly, unless I am mistaken, we can establish the definition that [definire quia] truth is rightness perceptible only to the mind.” (S., p. 191) This introduces the final discussion of the dialogue, the student asking: “But since you have taught me that all truth is rightness, and since rightness seems to me to be the same thing as justice, teach me also what I might understand justice to be.” (S., p. 191) The teacher’s first response is that justice, truth, and rightness are convertible with each other. “[W]hen we are speaking of rightness perceptible only to the mind, truth and rightness and justice are mutually defined in relation to each other [invicem sese definiunt].” (S., p. 192) This relationship allows the rational investigating human being to use one of these terms, or rather their understanding of the meaning of the terms, to arrive at understanding of the others (which is in fact what is going on in the dialogue itself) “[I]f somebody knows one of them and does not know the others, he can extend his knowledge [scientiam pertingere] though the known to the unknown. Verily, whoever knows one cannot not know the other two.” (S., p. 192)

Justice, however, has a sense more specific and appropriate to humans, “the justice to which praise is owed, just as to its contrary, namely injustice, condemnation is owed.” (S., p. 192) This sort of justice, Anselm argues, resides only in beings that know rightness, and therefore can will it. Accordingly, this kind of justice is present only in rational beings, and in human beings, it is not in knowledge or action but in the will. Justice is then defined as “rightness of will,” and as this could allow instances where one wills rightly, in other words what he or she ought to will, without wanting to be in such a situation, or instances where one does so want, but wills the right object for a bad motive, the definition of justice is further specified as “rightness of will kept for its own sake” (propter se servata). Anselm makes clear that this uprightness is received from God prior to the human being having it, willing it, or keeping it. And, it is in a certain way radically dependent on God’s own justice. “If we say that [God’s] uprightness is kept for its own sake, we do not seem to be able to suitably [conuenienter] speak likewise about any other rightness. For just as [God’s uprightness] itself and not some other thing, preserves itself, it is not through another but through itself, and likewise not on account of another thing but on account of itself.” (S., p. 196)

This leads to the final topic of the De Veritate, the unity of truth. According to Anselm, although there is a multiplicity of true things, and multiple and different ways for things to be truth, there is ultimately only one truth, prior to all of these, and in which they participate. From the discussions in earlier treatises, it is clear that this single and ultimate truth is, of course, God.

10. The De Libertate Arbitrii

This treatise is the second of the three treatises pertaining to the study of Sacred Scripture, and it deals primarily with the nature of the human will and its relation to the justice or rightness of will discussed at the end of the De Veritate. The student begins by asking the central questions:

Since free choice [liberum arbitrium] seems to be opposed to God’s grace, and predestination, and foreknowledge, I desire to know what this free choice is and whether we always have it. For if free choice is “to be able to sin and not sin,” just as it is customarily said by some people, and we always have it, in what way can we be in need of any grace? For if we do not always have it, why is sin imputed to us when we would sin without free choice. (S., v. 1, p. 207)

The immediate response is the denial that freedom of choice is or includes the ability to sin, for this would mean that God and the good angels, who cannot sin, would not have free choice. Anselm is unwilling even to entirely distinguish free choice of God and good angels from that of humans. “Although the free choice of humans differs from the free choice of God and the good angels, still the definition of this freedom, in accordance with this name, ought to be the same in either case.” (S., p. 208)

It appears at first that a will which can turn towards sinning or not sinning is more free, but this is to be able to lose what befits and what is useful or advantageous for (quod decet et quod expedit) the one willing. To be able to sin is actually an ability to become more unfree. Key to the argument is that not sinning is understood as a positive condition of maintaining uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo). Anselm makes two key points in support of this. “The will that cannot turn away from the righteousness of not sinning is thereby freer than one that can desert it [righteousness].” (S., p. 208) The analysis of the conceptions of freedom, sin, and power are similar to those in Proslogion Chapter 7: “The ability to sin, therefore, which when added to the will decreases its freedom and when taken away increases it, is neither freedom nor a part of freedom.” (S., v. 1, p. 209)

This raises two problems, however. Both the fallen angels and the first human were able to sin and did sin. Given the argument just made, being able to sin and freedom seem foreign (aliena) to each other, but if one does not sin from free choice, it seems one must sin of necessity. In addition, the notion of being a “servant of sin” requires clarification, specifically explaining how a free being can be mastered by sin, and thereby become a servant. Anselm makes a subtle distinction. In the case of the first man or the fallen angel, the Devil:

He sinned by his choice which was free, but not through that from which [unde] it was free, i.e. by the ability through which he was able to [per potestatem qua poterat] not sin and to not serve sin, but rather by the ability of sinning that he had [per potestatem quam habebat peccandi], by which he was neither aided toward the freedom of not sinning nor compelled to the service of sinning. (S., v. 1, p. 210)

Analogously to this, if somebody is able to be the servant of sin, this does not mean that sin is able to master him, so that his choice to sin, to become a servant of sin, is not free. Another question arises then, how a person, after becoming a servant of sin, would still be free, to which the answer is that one still retains some natural freedom of choice, but is unable to use one’s freedom of choice in exactly the same way as one could prior to choosing to sin. (Later in Chapter 12, Anselm clarifies that being a “servant of sin” is precisely “an inability to avoid sinning.”)

The difference, however, is all important. The freedom of choice which they originally possessed was oriented towards an end, that of “willing what they ought to will and what is advantageous for them to will,” (S., p. 211) in other words, uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo) of will. Anselm then considers four different possible ways in which they had this freedom oriented towards righteousness or uprightness of will:

  1. whether for acquiring it without anyone giving it, since they did not yet have it
  2. whether for receiving it when they did not yet have it, if someone were to give it to them so that they might have it
  3. whether for deserting what they received and for recovering by themselves what they had deserted
  4. whether for always keeping it once it was received (S., v. 1, p. 211)

The first three possibilities are rejected, leaving only the fourth. Rational creatures were originally given uprightness of will, which they were obliged to keep, but free (in one sense) to keep or lose. Freedom of choice, however, has a reason, namely, keeping this original uprightness-of-will for its own sake.

There are then two different possible states. So long as one keeps uprightness-of-will for its own sake, one does so freely. Once one loses uprightness-of-will through use of one’s free choice, one no longer has the ability to keep uprightness-of-will, really by definition, since one has after all lost it. Here, Anselm clarifies: “Even if uprightness of will is lacking, still [a] rational nature does not possess less than what belongs to it. For, as I view it, we have no ability that by itself suffices unto itself for its action; and still, when those things are lacking without which our abilities can hardly be brought to action, we still no less say that we have those abilities that are in us.” (S., p. 212-3)

He employs two analogies, one general, and one more specific. One can have an ability or an instrument that can accomplish something, but when the conditions for its employment are lacking, it cannot by itself bring anything about. Likewise, seeing a mountain requires not only sight, but also light and a mountain actually being there to be seen. When uprightness of will is lacking, having been lost, one still has theability to keep it, but the conditions for having and keeping it are lacking. “What prevents us from having the power of keeping uprightness of will for sake of that very uprightness, even if this very uprightness is absent, so long as within us there is reason, by which we are able to recognize it, and will, by which we are able to hold onto it? For the freedom of choice spoken of here consists in both of these [ex his enim constat].” (S., p. 214)

Chapters 5-9 discuss temptation, specifically how the will can be overcome by temptation, thereby turning away from or losing uprightness-of-will, by willing an action (for example, lying, murder, theft, adultery) contrary to God’s will. Anselm concedes that a person can be placed in a situation where options are constrained, and where unwelcome consequences follow from every option, for instance, when a person is constrained to choose between lying and thereby avoiding death (for a while), and dying. The will is stronger than any temptation, or even the Devil himself, but both temptation and the Devil can create difficulties for the resisting person, and can constrain the situations of choice. In these cases, the will can allow itself to be overcome. This still involves free choice of the will, but this is a free choice for one sort of unfreedom or another. Anselm argues that “a rational nature always possesses free choice, since it always possesses the ability of keeping uprightness of will for the sake of this rightness itself, even though with difficulty at some times.” (S., p. 222)

Once this uprightness has been lost, or rather abandoned freely, the free human being becomes a servant of sin because it cannot by itself regain that uprightness on its own. “Indeed, just as no will, before it possessed uprightness, was able to acquire it unless God gave it, so, after it deserted what it had received, it is not able to regain it unless God gives it back.” (S., p. 222) In such a condition, a human being remains free in the sense that they could keep uprightness-of-will, in other words, not sin, precisely by freely choosing to keep it, if they had it, which they do not. Once God gives it again, a human being is then once again free to keep it or to lose it. Freedom in the full sense for Anselm, therefore, consists in the ability to keep uprightness-of-will for its own sake, that is to say, choosing and acting in such a way as to keep oneself from losing it, even when faced with temptation.

11. The De Casu Diaboli

This dialogue, considerably longer than the preceding De Veritate and De Libertate, further develops certain themes they raised, and addresses several other philosophical issues of major importance, including the nature of evil and negation, and the complexities of the will. The dialogue begins in an attempt to understand the implications of all created beings having nothing that they have not received from God. “No creature has anything [aliud] from itself. For what does not even have itself from itself, in what way could it have anything from itself?” (S., v. 1, p. 233) Only God, the Creator, alone has anything (quidquid) from himself. All other beings, as dependent on God for their being, have what they have from him. The student raises an initial problem in Chapter 1, having to do with divine causation. It seems then that God is the cause not only of created beings having something, and for their being, but also that God is then the cause for their passing into non-being. This would then mean that God is the cause not only for whatever is, but also for whatever is not.

The teacher makes a needed distinction here. A thing is said to cause another thing to be in several different cases. One who actually causes something else to be is properly said to cause it. When one able to cause something not to be does not so cause it, and then the thing is (because the first thing does not interfere with the second thing being or coming to be), the first thing is improperly said to cause the second. Accordingly, God is said to cause things in both ways. God is also improperly said to cause what is not not to be, when what is actually meant by this is that God simply does not cause it to be. Likewise, when things pass from being to not-being, God does not cause this, even though he does not conserve them in being, because they simply return to their original state of non-being.

This has a bearing on the question of divine responsibility for evil, setting up the other problems of the dialogue.

Just as nothing that is not good comes from the Supreme Good, and every good is from the Supreme Good, likewise nothing that is not being [essentia] comes from the Supreme Being [essentia], and all being is from the Supreme Being. Since the Supreme Good is the Supreme Being, it follows that every being is a good thing and every good thing is a being. Therefore, just as nothing and non-being [non esse] are not being [essentia], likewise they are not good. So, nothing and non-being are not from He from whom nothing is unless it is good and being. (S., p. 235)

The central problem is that of understanding how the Devil could be responsible for his own sin, given that what he has he has from God, and the lengthy argumentation in Chapter 3 sets in clear light the problem’s complex nature. It seems that there is an inconsistency between God’s goodness and the justness of his judgment, on the one hand, and the Devil not receiving perseverance from God who did not give it to him, on the other hand. The student is making the global assumption, however, that since giving X is the cause of X being received, not giving X is the cause of X not being received.

In some cases this does not hold, however, and the teacher supplies an example. “If I offer [porrigo] you something, and you accept it [accipis], I do not therefore give it because you receive it [accipis], but you therefore receive it because I give it, and the giving is the cause of the receiving.” (S., p. 236) In that positive case, the giving is the cause of the receiving, but, if the case is made negative the order of causing what takes place (or rather what does not take place) is the opposite. “What if I offer that very thing to someone else and he does not accept it? Does he therefore not accept it because I do not give it?” The student realizes that the proper way of looking at matters is “rather that you do not give it because he does not accept it.” (S., p. 236) In cases like these, where not-giving X is not the cause of X not being received, if one does not give X, it can still be inferred that X is not received. This answer does not quell the student’s initial misgivings, however, for it simply pushes the fundamental problem back further. “If you wish to assert that God did not give to him because he did not receive, I ask: why did he not receive? Was it because he was not able to, or because he did not will to? For if he did not have the ability or the will to receive [potestatem aut uoluntatem accipiendi], God did not give it.” (S., p. 237) This seems to place the responsibility for the Devil’s lack back on God, and the student asks: “[I]f he was not able to have the ability or the will to receive perseverance unless God gives it, in what did he sin, by not accepting what God did not give him to be able or to will to receive [posse aut uelle accipere]?” (S., p. 237)

The answer is that God in fact did give this ability and will, and the student concludes that the Devil did receive perseverance from God. The teacher makes two important clarifications. The first is that “I did not say that God gave him the receiving of perseverance [accipere perseuerantiam], but rather to be able or to will to [posse aut uelle] receive perseverance.” (S., p. 237) The student then concludes that since the Devil willed to and was able to (voluit et potuit) receive perseverance, he did in fact receive it.

This leads to the second, much more involved clarification. There are cases where one is able to and wills to do something, but does not finish it or bring it about completely or perfectly, cases where one’s initial will is changed before the thing is entirely finished.

T: Then, you willed and you were able to persevere in what you did not persevere.
S: Certainly I willed to, but I did not persevere in willing [in voluntate], and so I did not persevere in the action.
T: Why did you not persevere in willing?
S: Because I did not will to.
T: But, so long as you willed to persevere in the action, you willed to persevere in that willing [in voluntate]? (S., p. 238)

The will is marked by a reflexivity, as the student recognizes when the teacher asks why he did not persevere in willing. One can answer that he did not persevere in willing (which is the reason he did not then continue to will) because he did not will to. This type of explanation could be iterated infinitely, and would not really explain anything thereby. Instead, the explanation for failure of will (defectus. . . uoluntatis) requires reference to something else, and this requires coining a new expression. As the teacher says: “Let us say. . . . that to persevere in willing is to ‘will completely’ [peruelle].”(S., p. 238) And, he asks his student: “When, therefore, you did not complete what you willed to and were able to, why did you not complete it?” In response, the student supplies the conclusion: “Because I did not will it completely.” (S., p. 238) This allows a partial resolution to the problem: even though the Devil received the will and the ability to receive perseverance and the will and the ability to persevere, he did not actually receive the perseverance because he did not will it completely. Again, this answer simply pushes the problem to yet another level, leading the student to ask:

Again I ask why he did not will completely. For when you say that what he willed he did not completely will, you are saying something like: What he willed at first, he did not will later. So, when he did not will what he willed before, why did he not will it unless because he did not have the will to? And by this latter I do not mean the will that he had previously when he willed it but the one that he did not have when he did not will it. But why did he not have this will, unless because he did not receive it? And, why did he not receive it, unless because God did not give it? (S., p. 239)

The teacher reminds the student of the point established earlier, that God did not give to the Devil because the Devil did not receive. Again the failure is on the side of the creature, and at this point, the teacher asserts that the Devil could have received keeping (tenere) what he had but instead abandoned or deserted it (deseruit). The relation between not-receiving and desertion has a parallel structure to not-giving and not-receiving: the Devil did not receive because he deserted, and God did not give to the Devilbecause the Devil did not receive.

Once again, this is only a partial solution, and it still seems that God could be responsible for the fall of the Devil, because God did not give something to the Devil, namely the will to keep, not to desert, what he had. The cause for someone deserting something, the student claims, is because that person does not will to keep it. The teacher’s response here is similar to the previous responses, since he distinguishes cases where the causal relation the student asserts to hold does not hold. It is dissimilar, however, and brings the complex argumentation of Chapter 3 to a close, because it introduces the key notion of conflicting objects of the will. Using the example of a miser who would will both to keep his money and to have bread, which requires him to spend money, the teacher notes that in this case, willing to desert is prior to not willing to keep some good, precisely because one wills to desert the thing in order to have something that one prefers to have. In the case of the Devil then:

the reason he did not will when he should have and what he should have was not that his will was deficient [defecit] because God failed [deo . . .deficiente] to give, but rather that the Devil himself, by willing what he should not have, expelled his good will because of an evil will arising. Accordingly, it was not because he did not have a good persevering will or he did not receive it, because God did not give it, but rather that God did not give it because the Devil, by willing what he should not have, deserted the good will, and by deserting it did not keep it. (S., p. 240)

In Chapters 4-28, issues raised by this solution to the problem are explored: the complex nature of the will, and the ontological status of evil, nothing, and injustice. Chapter 4 introduces a key distinction in objects of the will, between justice (justitia) and what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum). The case of the Devil is the case for rational, willing creatures generally. The teacher notes: “He could not have willed anything except for justice or what is beneficial. For, happiness, which all rational natures will, consists of beneficial things.” And, the student confirms this: “We can recognize this in ourselves, who will nothing except what we deem to be just or beneficial.” (S., p. 241)

The Devil went wrong by willing something beneficial, but which he did not have and was not supposed to have at the time he willed it; this was to will in a disordered manner (inordinate), and hereby to will the beneficial thing in such a way as to thereby not keep justice, precisely because willing the beneficial thing in a disordered way required abandoning justice. The Devil willed to be both like God and above God, by willing in such a way as to reject the order God introduced into things (including wills), or put in another way, using a term that somewhat resists translation: “he willed something by his very own will alone [propria voluntate], which was subject [subdita] to nobody. For it should be for God alone to so will something by his very own will alone, so that he does not follow a will superior [to his own].” (S., p. 242)

The will, in both angels and human beings, is complex, and can be regarded from different though complementary points of view, and in terms of its objects, which may differ or coincide. Chapters 12-14 discuss the relationships between the will, happiness, and justice. There are two fundamental kinds of good and two kinds of evil: justice (justitia) and what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum); injustice, and what is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum). Rational beings, as well as other beings that can perceive, have a natural will for avoiding what is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum) and for possessing what is beneficial, useful, or agreeable (commodum), and by this natural will, which is for happiness, they move themselves to willing other things, such as means by which to achieve the good they will.

In contrast, rational beings can be just or unjust, and can will justice or injustice. While all rational beings will happiness, not all of them will justice. It is possible for the two wills to conflict, and for one to will happiness inordinately, and in this way desert justice. Alternately, it is possible for one to will justice, which affects how happiness is willed.

Justice, when it is added, would so temper the will for happiness, that it would both curb the will’s excess and not cut off its ability of exceeding. So, because one would will to be happy, one could go to excess [excedere], but because one would will justly, one would not will to go to excess [excedere], and so having a just will for happiness one could and should be happy. And, by not willing what one ought not will, even though one could, one would merit being able to never will what should not be willed, and by always keeping justice through a restrained [moderatam] will, one would in no way be in need; but, if one were to desert justice through an unrestrained [immoderatam] will, one would be in need in every way. (S., p. 258)

Chapters 15-16 show that the relation between justice and injustice is one of a good and its privation, or put another way, justice is something, meaning it has goodness and it has being, while injustice is nothing but the absence or privation of the justice that should exist, namely in a will. The priority of justice over injustice means that the will retains traces (vestigia) of the justice it abandoned, namely that it ought to have justice. Injustice, or the state of being unjust, does not have any being, meaning it is nothing.

The relationships between evil, injustice, nothing, and the will are explained in Chapters 7-11, 19-20, and 26. First, as the teacher explains, the will itself, considered as will is not nothing. “Now, even if [the will, and the turning of the will] are not substances, still it cannot be proven that they are not beings [essentias], for there are many beings other than those which are properly called ‘substances.’ So then, a good will is not more something than an evil will is, nor is the latter more evil than the former is good.” (S., p. 245) The conclusion of this is not that the evil will is not in fact evil, but rather that “the evil will is not that very evil that makes evil people evil.” (S., p. 245)

The evil that makes people evil is instead injustice, the privation of justice, which is nothing. Saying that injustice and evil are in fact nothing raises a problem, however, for it does seem as if injustice and evil aresomething. For one, it seems that good and evil are both correlative to each other. “[E]vil is a privation of the good, I concede, but I see that good is no less the privation of evil. (S., p. 247) Posing a second difficulty, it seems that “evil” must signify something, since “evil” is a name. Lastly, the effects of evil seem in our experience to be something, so it seems paradoxical to insist that their cause is “nothing.”

These difficulties are resolved in several ways. First, as noted earlier, the relationship between evil or injustice as a privation, and its opposite, justice, is not a reciprocal one. Injustice is the privation of justice, justice is not the privation of injustice, but that which injustice is a privation of. Put another way, justice is something positive, and has being, and its being is not dependent upon or conditioned by its opposite and privation, injustice.

A second resolution lies in noting that “nothing” does signify, but signifies by negation. As the teacher says, making an important distinction:

“[E]vil” and “nothing” do signify something; still though what they signify is not evil or nothing. But, there is another way in which they signify something and what is signified is something; not truly something, though, but as-if something [quasi aliquid]. For indeed, many things are said in accordance with the form [of language] [secundum formam], which are not said in accordance with the reality [secundum rem]. (S., p. 250)So, in this way, “evil” and “nothing” signify something, and what is signified is something not in accordance with the reality but in accordance with the form of speaking. (S., p. 251)

A third resolution resides in explaining the relationship between the evil and nothing(ness) of injustice and the seeming positivity and being of things that get called evil. The will itself, as something, is good; in-itself, willing objects of the will, from the basest pleasures to being-like God, is good. Even the base and unclean useful or pleasurable things that irrational animals take pleasure in (commoda infima et immunda quibusirrationalia animalia delectanturS., p. 257) are in themselves good. What allows some positive existing thing to be an evil is the disorder it is involved in, and this has to do with the will, and with injustice as such, which are the source of any positivity evil has. “[S]ince no thing is called “evil” except for an evil will or on account of an evil will – like an evil man and an evil action – nothing is clearer than that no thing is evil, nor is evil anything but the absence of the justice that has been deserted in the will, or in some thing because of an evil will.” (S., p. 264)The absence of justice in the will, or injustice, is always strictly speaking nothing, the absence or lack of what ought to be. However, “sometimes the evil that is harmful or unpleasant (incommodum) is clearly nothing, like blindness, other times it is something, like sadness or pain.” (S., p. 274) What we typically focus on in thinking about evil are the latter cases. “When, then, we hear the word ‘evil,’ we do not fear the evil that is nothing, but the evil that is something, which follows from the absence of the good. For, from injustice and blindness, which are evil and which are nothing, follow many harmful or unpleasant things (incommoda) that are evil and are something, and these are what we dread when we hear the word ‘evil.’” (S., p. 274)

Accordingly, returning to the original issue, what creatures have that is good, they have from God, and what they have of evil derives from them (or from other creatures), but ultimately from nothing, that is to say, from a lack of what ought to be (or of what ought to have been). In any given case, of course, for instance the Devil’s case, it may take considerable analysis to see how what God gave permitted evil to take place.

12. The De Concordia

This late work is of particular interest for several reasons. In its content, it deals with matters examined by Anselm’s previous works, developing his doctrines further. The De Concordia refers to earlier works by name, specifically De Veritate, De Libertate Arbitrii, De Casu Diaboli, and De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato. Stylistically, its form is intermediary between those of the treatises and those of the dialogues, for Anselm addresses the possible objections and responses of an interlocutor in the first book, but does so within one continuous discourse. By the second and third books, Anselm no longer addresses an interlocutor. The three main topics or “questions” of the title unevenly divide the books of the work.

The first question, or problem, is how free choice (liberum arbitrium) and God’s foreknowledge could be compatible. This is really a clash between freedom and necessity. “[I]t is necessary [necesse est] that those things that God foreknows be going to happen [esse futura], and those that come to be through free choice do not arrive through any necessity.” (S., v. 2, p. 245) Anselm’s procedure is to assume both free choice and God’s foreknowledge in order to see whether they do in fact contradict each other, reasoning that, if they are genuinely incompatible, some other impossibility will arise from them. The assumption does not in fact generate a contradiction.

[I]f something is going to happen without necessity [sine necessitate], God, who foreknows all future things foreknows this very thing. So, what God foreknows necessarily [necessitate] is going to happen, just as it is foreknown. Accordingly, it is necessary [necesse est] for something to be going to happen without necessity. Therefore, for one who rightly understands this, the foreknowledge upon which necessity follows and the free choice from which necessity is removed do not seem contradictory at all, since it is necessary that God foreknows what is going to happen, and God foreknows something to be going to happen without any necessity. (S., p. 245)

The interlocutor raises several objections. The first is easily resolved, since it consists in simply shifting the ground from actions in general to sinning. Since God foreknows whether a person will sin or not, it seems that it is then necessary that a person sins or does not sin. Anselm simply makes explicit the full significance of what is being asserted, after which it is clear that framing the issue in terms of sin simply generates the same structure. “You should not say just: ‘God foreknows that I am going to sin or I am not going to sin,’ but rather: ‘God foreknows that without necessity I am going to sin or I am not going to sin.’” (S., p. 246)

The second objection raises a puzzle that stems from the sense of “necessity.” “Necessity seems to mean [sonare] compulsion or restraint [coactionem uel prohibitionem]. So, if it is necessary that I sin from my willing, I understand myself to be compelled by some hidden force to the will to sin; and if I do not sin, I am restrained from the will to sin.” (S., p. 246-7) In response, Anselm notes that some things are said to necessarily be or not be, even when there is no compulsion or restraint. In the case of voluntary actions, God foreknows them, but this foreknowledge does not produce any compulsion or restraint. To the contrary, God foreknows them precisely as voluntary actions. There is a necessity involved, but one that “follows,” rather than “precedes,” or determines, the thing or event.

Anselm provides examples of these two modalities of necessity. An uprising that is going to take place tomorrow does not occur by necessity. It could happen otherwise, although it will not. The sun rising tomorrow will happen by necessity. It must happen that way.

The uprising, which will not be from necessity, is asserted to be going to happen only by a following necessity [sequenti necessitate], since what is going to happen is being said of what is going to happen. For, if it is going to happen tomorrow, by necessity it is going to happen. The sunrise, however, is understood to be going to happen by both kinds of necessity, namely the preceding [praecedenti] necessity that makes the thing be – so it will be, since it is necessary [necesse est] that it be – and the following necessity that does not compel it to be. (S., p. 250)

When one says that it is necessary for what God foreknows to happen, care is needed lest these different modalities of necessity get mixed up. In the case of human willing, the necessity is of the following, not the preceding kind. There is a temporality involved in the necessity of human will.

What the free will wills, the free will can and cannot not-will [non velle], and it is necessary that it will. For, it can not-will before it wills, since it is free, and once it wills, it cannot not-will, but rather it is necessary that it will, since it is impossible for it to will and not will the same thing at the same time. . . . there is a twofold necessity, because [what the will freely wills] is compelled to be by the will, and what happens cannot at the same time not happen. But the free will makes these necessities, which can avoid them [coming to be] before they are. (S., p. 251)

Far from free will being incompatible with necessity and with God’s foreknowledge, free will is in fact productive of some necessity. Anselm employs a line of reasoning similar to that used in earlier works, most notably in the De Veritate. “Why then is it something astonishing if in this way something is from freedom and from necessity, when there are many things that are grasped in opposite ways by changing the point of view [diverse ratione]?” (S., p. 253) Employing this technique of distinction allows him the conclude that they are in fact compatible: “No inconsistency arises if, in accordance with the reasons given earlier, we assert one and the same thing to be necessarily going to be, since it is going to be, and that it is by no necessity compelled to be going to be, unless by that necessity that was said earlier to come to be from free will.” (S., p. 253)

In Chapter 5, ultimately in order to be able to provide a hermeneutic for seemingly problematic Scriptural passages, Anselm provides readers with an intellectual glimpse of eternity. Within eternity, there is no past or future, but only present; not the fleeting present of our temporal experience, but an eternal present, one that has an ontological priority over time as we experience it. “Although nothing is there except what is present, it is not the temporal present, like ours, but rather the eternal, within which all times altogether are contained. If in a certain way the present time contains every place and all the things that are in any place, likewise, every time is encompassed [clauditur] in the eternal present, and everything that is in any time.” (S., p. 254)

The nature of temporal things is that, insofar as they are in time, they do not always exist, and they change from time to time, whereas, as they exist in eternity, they always exist and are unchangeable. Anselm again frames this in terms of different points of view. Something can be able to be changed in time and still be unchangeable in eternity “For things that are changeable in time and unchangeable in eternity are not more opposed than not being in some time is to always being in eternity, or having been or going to be in accordance with time and not having been or not going to be in eternity.” (S., p. 255) This allows a fuller understanding of the relation between God’s foreknowledge and free choice. Before (in the temporal sequence) something is willed by a being existing in time, such as sinning or not sinning, it can be otherwise. It already exists in eternity, however, which is how God knows (or from our point of view, foreknows) it.

Anselm deals briefly with the second question or problem, reconciling predestination with free choice. This question seems to present a more problematic issue than divine foreknowledge. One can, as Anselm does, reconcile divine foreknowledge with free human choices by taking the position that God knows the free human choices as free, but from a vantage point of eternity, in which the free, uncompelled or restrained human actions have already happened, or more properly expressed are already happening. Predestination, however, seems to involve God making things happen the way they do. There is a possible resolution, however; we can say: “God predestines evil people and their evil works when he does not correct them and their evil works. But he is said to foreknow and predestine good things, because he causes [facit] that they be and that they be good; but for evil things, he only causes them to be what they are essentially, not that they are evil.” (S., p. 261) That is, (in accordance with the positions developed in Anselm’s earlier works), God never directly causes something evil, but rather provides the basis, in being and goodness, for what is then turned to evil, turned away from how it ought to be.

God does predestine human actions, according to Anselm, but he predestines them precisely as free or voluntary actions, which does not impose a necessity upon them that does not come from the choosing person’s willing, by the sort of following necessity discussed in relation to foreknowledge.

For God – even though He predestines – does not cause [facit] these things by compelling or restraining the will, but rather by committing [dimittendo] it to its own power. But even though the will uses its own power, it does nothing that God does not do in good things by his grace, in bad things not by fault of his own will but the will of the person. . . And just as foreknowledge, which does not err, only foreknows what is true, just as it will be, whether it is necessary or spontaneous, likewise, predestination . . . predestines a thing only as it is in foreknowledge. (S., p. 261)

The third question or problem is reconciling God’s grace and human free choice. In the course of showing that there is no real contradiction between these, Anselm’s treatment ranges over a number of issues. There are a variety of different viewpoints to be considered. Some, supporting themselves by appeal to Scripture, maintain that only divine grace leads to salvation; others, likewise appealing to other Scriptural passages, maintain that salvation depends on our will. Furthering the first position, some cite passages that seem to have good works and salvation depend on grace, and others point to the common enough experience of people who, despite their efforts, fail. In addition to Scriptural passages that teach that humans have free choice, or that urge people to do good and that condemn evil, there is a line of reasoning supporting free choice, namely: “If nobody were to do good or evil through free choice, then there would be no reason why [nec ullo modo esset cur] God justly gives what they deserve [retribueret] to good people and bad people on account of the merits of each one.” (S., p. 264)

The position that Anselm develops can be summarized as the following: Grace and free choice are not only compatible, but they in fact cooperate with each other. So, setting aside the exception of baptized infants, grace and free choice are both required for one to be saved. The ways in which grace and free choice cooperate with each other, as well as the ways in which free choice fails to cooperate with grace, are complex. Four main features of this are: the relationship between uprightness or righteousness (rectitudo) and grace; the need for cooperation with grace through one’s will; Anselm’s threefold distinction about the will; and the will for happiness and the will for justice.

Uprightness of will was discussed at length in Anselm’s earlier works, but it receives a more sophisticated and nuanced treatment in the De Concordia. As before: “There is no doubt that the will only wills rightly [recte] when it is upright [recta]. . . the will is not upright because it wills rightly, but it wills rightly because it is upright.” (S., p. 265-6) When the will wills uprightness for its own sake, it quite clearly wills rightly, and as in the earlier works, the will thereby wills to remain in this uprightness. In the De Concordia treatment, however, it is possible for one to will more uprightness. “I do not deny that an upright will wills an uprightness it does not yet have, when it wills to have a greater uprightness than it has; but I say that no will can will uprightness, if it does not have the uprightness by which it wills it.” (S., p. 266)

Later, Anselm says something very similar:

It is said to those already converted [i.e. turned towards God, conservis]: “be converted,” either so that they are further converted or so that they keep themselves converted. For, those who say: “convert us, God,” are already in some way converted, since they have an upright will when they will to be converted. But they pray through what they have received so that their conversion be augmented, just like those who were believers and said: “increase our faith.” It is as if both of these groups said: “increase in us what you gave us, bring to fruition [perfice] what you began. (S., p. 272)

When one has uprightness, one can will to preserve it, but lacking it, one cannot simply will oneself to have it, and then thereby have it. In addition, a creature cannot have uprightness from itself, nor can it have it from another creature. Instead, it can only have it through God’s grace.

Grace, as Anselm states clearly, is not something simple to pin down. For one, there are many different ways in which grace is bestowed. As Anselm says, he is “not up to the task [non. . .valeam] – for it does this in many ways – of enumerating the ways in which, after this uprightness has been received, grace aids free choice to keep what it received.” (S., p. 267) For another, graces follow on graces, and this takes place in more than one way as well. For instance: “If the will, by free choice keeping what it received, merits either an augmentation of the justice it has received, or even the power for a good will, or some sort of reward, all of these are fruits of the first grace, and “grace for grace,” and therefore all of this is to be imputed to grace. . .” (S., p. 266-7)

Free choice can cooperate with grace, grace that is first given, that is to say, the giving of the uprightness that the will receives by free choice, and then, in keeping this righteousness, cooperates with grace again. The grace can only be lost by the choices made to abandon uprightness in favor of something else. Worthy of note, in this treatise, Anselm gives a concrete example of this sort of grace. “This uprightness is never separated from the will except when it wills something else that is not in harmony with this uprightness. Just as when somebody receives the uprightness of willing sobriety, and they reject it by wiling an immoderate pleasure of drinking. (S., p. 267)

In Anselm’s view, graces are offered in many ways, even at the moments when one is deciding. He give several examples of how grace assists the free choice of the will when one is tempted to abandon the uprightness one has received, “by mitigating or even entirely cancelling the force of the besieging temptation, or by augmenting the affection of that same uprightness.” (S., p. 268) Anselm supplies a principle of interpretation in these matters: “In short, since everything is subject to God’s ordination, whatever happens to a person that aids the free choice to receiving or keeping that uprightness of which I speak, is to be imputed entirely to grace.” (S., p. 268)

In his explanation of the extended metaphor of cultivation in Book 3, Chapter 6, Anselm provides further examples of grace, showing grace coming from grace and the involvement of free choice at each point. The metaphor is:

[J]ust as the earth, without any cultivation by humans, brings forth innumerable herbs and trees without which human nature is nourished or by which it is even destroyed, those that most necessary to us for nourishing life [are not brought forth] without great labor and cultivation, and not without seeds. Likewise the human hearth, without teaching, without application [studio] spontaneously germinates thoughts and willings [voluntates] that are of no use for salvation or are even harmful, whereas those, without which we make no progress to salvation of the soul, never conceive and germinate without a seed of their own sort and laborious cultivation. (S., p. 270)

Grace, the seed, involves, even requires human participation and effort, and at the same time aids the human effort at nearly every turn. Grace and human willing constantly interact.

That [preachers] are sent, is a grace. And for this reason, preaching is a grace, since what comes down from grace is grace; and hearing [the Word preached] is grace, and understanding what is heard is grace, and uprightness of wiling is grace. Truly sending, preaching, hearing, understanding are nothing unless the will wills what the mind understands. . . So, what the mind conceives from hearing the Word is the seed of preaching and uprightness is the “growth” [incrementum] that God gives, without which “neither he who plants nor he who waters is anything, but rather God who gives the growth.” (S., p. 271)

Anselm’s discussion of the will in the De Concordia revisits some of the same doctrines developed in earlier works. A person is not forced by temptation or oppression to abandon uprightness of will, but rather fails to will to keep it because he or she wills something else. What a person wills, they either will on account of uprightness or some benefit. These motives can, and in some cases do, clash with each other. There is a finer analysis of the will, one used later as the starting point in the De Moribus attributed to Anselm.

Since particular instruments have what they are [hoc quod sunt], and their aptitudes, and their uses, let us distinguish in the will that on account of which we call it an instrument, its aptitudes, and its uses. These aptitudes in the will we can call “affections,” since the instrument of willing is affected by its aptitudes.The will is spoken of equivocally, and in three ways. For, the instrument of willing is one thing, the affection of the instrument is another, and the use of this same instrument is yet another. The instrument of willing is that power [vis] of the soul that it uses for willing . . . The affection of this instrument is that by which this instrument itself is affected to willing something even when it does not think about what it wills . . . . The use of this very instrument is what we have only when we think about the thing that we will. (S., p. 280)

There is only one instrument of willing, and the instrument itself does not admit of degrees. There are many uses of the will, that is, actual willings in concrete situations, using the instrument of the will. There are multiple affections or aptitudes of the will, and they do admit of greater and lesser degrees. Anselm states that all of these can be regarded as different wills, since they are not identical (they are distinguishable without being separable). The distinction also allows clarification of the agency of the will: “The will as instrument moves all of the other instruments that we freely [sponte] use, both those that are part of us – like hand, tongue, sight – and those external to us – like pen, hatchet – and causes [facit] all of our voluntary motions. Indeed, it moves itself through its own affection, whence it can be called an instrument that moves its very self.” (S., p. 283-4)

Two affections are of particular importance, and allow clarification of how one deserts justice or uprightness of will. “From these two affections, which we still call ‘wills,’ all the merit of a person comes, whether good or bad. These two wills differ, however, because the one which is to willing benefit is inseparable, but the one for willing uprightness is separable.” (S., p. 284) This means that the will to benefit, which Anselm also calls “will to happiness” (uoluntas beatitudinis) is always part of the human being, whereas the will to justice is not. A person can will justice or uprightness (if they have it), in which case they do have it, or a person can not. It is by deserting justice, or by not willing the will to justice, in order to will something else, meaning happiness of such a sort that it is incompatible with justice, that the will as a whole, and a person as a whole goes astray. This then happens by the use of the person’s free choice.

13. The Fragments

Anselm left behind fragments of an unfinished work that is of some philosophical interest. Stylistically, they appear to have been intended to be a full dialogue, and the portions that we possess are written in polished Latin style. Their content consists in analyses of concepts and terminology central to certain parts of Anselm’s work, and although the theme of uncritical acceptance of ordinary linguistic usage obscuring the real matters at hand is not a new one, the analyses are carried out to a degree of sophistication unparalleled by the extant works. The student begins the dialogue: “There are many matters regarding which I have for some time wished your response, among which are ability [potestas] and inability [impotentia], possibility and impossibility, necessity and freedom. I enumerate all of these together at the same time, because the knowledge of them seems to me to be mixed up together.” (u.W, p. 23)

The student is led to several absurd conclusions in reasoning about these matters, which Anselm treated in earlier works, for example reconciling God being omnipotent with God being unable to do certain things, or it being impossible for God to do those things. The teacher indicates that what is needed is an understanding of the meaning of the verb “to do” (facere), and of what is, properly speaking (proprie) “one’s own” (suum alicuius). “To do” (later, Anselm will indicate that agere, “to act” does this as well) has an interesting and unique status, since it is used colloquially as substitute for many other expressions, even including those involving “not doing” (non facere). The expressions which it may substitute for can be the proper responses to the question: “what is he/she doing?”

The teacher then introduces several discussions about causes. “[E]verything of which any verb is said [i.e. any subject of which a verb is predicated], is some cause for what is signified by that verb being the case. And, every cause, in ordinary linguistic usage [usu loquendi] is said to “make” or do” [facere] what it is the cause of.” (u.W, p. 26) Some of these are straightforward, such as a person running causes that there is running. Some of these are not quite so straightforward. “For, in this way, one who sits, makes there to be sitting, and one who suffers, makes there to be suffering, because if the one who suffers were not to be, there would not be a suffering.” (u.W, p. 26) In addition, the being or nature of a thing is a cause for what can be said of it. “If, for example, we say: ‘(a) human being is an animal,’ (a) human being is a cause that there be an animal and that it be said that ‘there is animal.’ I do not mean that (a) human being is the cause for animal existing, but rather that (a) human being is the cause that it be and be called (an) animal. For by this name the entire human being is signified and conceived, in which whole animal is as a part.” (u.W, p. 27-8)

Next, the teacher notes that there are different ways (modis usus loquendi) of using the verb “to do,” “to make,” or “to cause” (facere), and although he concedes that their division is numerous and quite complicated (multiplex et nimis implicata), he advances a sixfold division of causing things to be or not to be.

Two ways, when:

  1. it causes what it is said to cause, or
  2. it does not cause what it is said to cause not to be

Four ways, when it causes or does not cause something else to be or not to be. For we say something to cause another thing to be, because. . . .

  1. it causes something else to be, or
  2. it does not cause something else to be, or
  3. because it causes something else not to be, or
  4. because it does not cause something else not to be. (u.W, p. 29)

He provides examples of each of these:

  1. . . . when somebody is said to cause another person to be dead by slaying him or her with a sword.
  2. The only example . . . I have is if I posit someone who could resuscitate a dead person, but does not will to do so. . . . In other matters, examples are abundant, as when we say that somebody causes an evil to be, one that, when he or she is able to, that somebody does not cause it not to be.
  3. . . . when it is asserted that someone killed another . . . because he or she ordered that the other be killed, or because he or she caused the killer to have a sword, or because he or she accused the one who was killed . . . . These people do not cause per se what is said to be caused . . . .but by doing something else . . . they act through an intermediary.
  4. . . .when we pronounce someone to have killed another, who did not provide arms to the one who was killed before he or she was killed, or who did not retrain the killer, or who did not do something that, had he or she done it, the person would not have been killed
  5. . . . by taking away the arms, one causes the one who is about to be killed to be disarmed, or by opening a door one causes the killer not to be closed up where he or she had been detained
  6. . . . when by not disarming the killer, one does not cause them not to be armed, or by not leading the one who would be killed away, so that they would not be in the killer’s presence. (u.W, p. 29-30)

The same six modes also hold for “to cause not to be” (facere non esse), and Anselm provides examples for them as well. In all but the first mode, the one who is supposed to cause something does not cause it directly. Likewise, the modes hold for “not to cause to be” (non facere esse) and “not to cause not to be” (non facere non esse). These tools for analysis, the teacher suggests, can be used for other verbs, for “is” (esse), and for “ought” or “owes” (debere), allowing restatement of the expressions in forms better signifying what is really meant by the expressions.

Willing, or “to will” (velle) presents an interesting set of conditions, for it parallels “to do” or “to cause.” “We say ‘to will’ in the same six modes as ‘to cause to be.’ Likewise, we say ‘to will not to be’ in all of the different ways as ‘to cause not to be.’” (u.W, p. 37) This expression can also be dealt with under a fourfold division. In the first, “efficient will” (efficiens), “we will in such a way that [ut], if we are able to, we cause to be what we will.” (u.W, p. 38) In another type of willing, “approving will” (approbans), “[w]e will something that we are able to cause to be but we do not cause to be, but still, if it happens, it pleases us, and we approve of it.” (u.W, p. 38) In yet another type of willing, “conceding will” (concedens), “we will something. . . like a creditor who, being indulgent, wills to accept from a debtor barley in place of the wheat [the debtor owes].” (u.W, p. 38) In the last kind, “someone is said to will what one neither approves nor concedes, but rather permits, when one could prohibit it.” (u.W, p. 38)

There is an order of implication to these wills as well:

[T]he one that I have called “efficient will,” when it wills, so far as it is able, it causes it, and it also approves it, concedes it, and permits it. The “approving” will does not cause what it wills, but it does approve it, concede it, and permit it. The “conceding” will does not cause or approve what it wills, unless on account of something else, but it does concede and permit it. The “permitting” will does not cause, or approve, or concede what it wills, but only permits it even though it disapproves of it. (u.W, p. 38-9)

These categories of analysis can be extended not simply to human willing, but also to the divine will, addressing some of the issues about the divine will and its compatibility with evil human or angelic acts raised and dealt with in the earlier works.

Anselm also provides further classification of causes. Some causes are efficient causes, for instance the maker of an object, or the wisdom that makes somebody wise. Other causes are not efficient causes, including the matter from which something is made, or space and time, within which spatial and temporal things (localia et temporalia) come to be. All of these are causes in some sense, since they all have some role in what is, or is not, being so.

Anselm also distinguishes between proximate, or immediate causes and distant, or mediated causes. “Proximate causes are those that by themselves (per se) cause what they are said to cause, with no other mediate cause standing in between them and the effect that they cause, and distant [longinquae] causes are those that do not by themselves (per se) cause what they are said to cause, unless there is either one or more other mediating cause(s).” (u.W, p. 40) The first two modes of “to cause” discussed earlier apply to proximate causes, the other four to distant causes. Both efficient causes and non-efficient causes can be proximate or distant causes, although, as Anselm points out, strictly speaking, distant causes are themselves proximate causes of something at least: “Although very often causes are said to causes not by themselves (per se), but by another (per aliud), i.e. by a medium – whence they can be called distant causes – still every cause has its proximate effect that it causes by itself (per se) and whose proximate cause it is.” (u.W, p. 41) All causes are involved in a linking or network of causes and effects whose ultimate origin is God. “Every cause has causes going back all the way to the supreme cause of all, God, who since He is the cause of everything that is something, does not himself have a cause. Every effect whatsoever has many causes of diverse types, except for the first effect, since the supreme cause alone created everything.” (u.W, p. 41)

Anselm also discusses the meaning of “something” (aliquid) and “ability” (potestas) in the fragments, largely reiterating points made in earlier works.

14. Other Writings

Anselm produced other works beyond those summarized and excerpted from here, including theEpistola de Incarnatione Verbi (on the Incarnation of the Word), De Conceptu Virginali et de Originali Peccato (on the Virgin Conception and Original Sin), De Processione Spiritus Sancti (on the Procession of the Holy Spirit), all of which contain some philosophical reasoning as well as theological.

The last century has seen several other Anselmian texts made available to scholars. As noted earlier, theFragments come from an unfinished work edited and established by Dom F .S. Schmitt, O.S.B. Arguably of greater significance is the De Moribus (on Human Morals), edited and established by R. W. Southern and Dom Schmitt in Memorials of St. Anselm, which discusses the affections of the will at great length, in great detail, and through the use of many illuminating metaphors (similtudines). As Southern and Dom Schmitt note, this work was added to considerably and edited by an unknown redactor, then circulated and attributed to Anselm as the De Simultudinibus. Also included in that volume are the Dicta Anselmi (Anselm’s Sayings), assembled and redacted most likely by Anselm’s companion, the monk Alexander.

In addition, Anselm left behind numerous letters, prayers, and meditations, many of very high literary and spiritual quality.

15. References and Further Readings

Several readily accessible research bibliographies on Anselm exist. Two particularly useful ones are:

  • Kienzler, Klaus. International Bibliography: Anselm of Canterbury (Lewiston, New York: Edwin Mellen Press. 1999)
  • Miethe, T.L. “The Ontological Argument: A Research Bibliography,” The Modern Schoolman v. 54 (1977)

a. Primary Sources

The standard scholarly version of Anselm’s collected works is the edition by Dom F. S. Schmitt, O.S.B.S. Anselmi Cantuariensis Archiepiscopi Opera Omnia. 6 vols. (Edinburgh: Thomas Nelson and Sons. 1940-1961). It was reprinted in 1968 by F. Fromann Verlag (Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt), and is available currently on CD-ROM from Past Masters.

Additional Latin writings may be found in Memorials of St. Anselm. R. W. Southern and F. S. Schmitt, O.S.B. eds. (Oxford University Press. 1969), and in Ein neues unvollendetes Werk des heilige Anselem von Canterbury, F. S. Schmitt, O.S.B., ed. (Munster: Aschendorf. 1936)

There are numerous English translations of Anselm’s works. Below are several of the most common:

  • St. Anselm’s Proslogion. Trans. M.J. Charlesworth. (Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1965)
  • Anselm of Canterbury: The Major Works. Trans. Brian Davies and Gillian Evans (New York: Oxford University Press, 1998)
  • St. Anselm: Basic Writings. Trans. S. N. Deane (La Salle, Illinois: Open Court Press, 1962)
  • The Letters of Saint Anselm of Canterbury. 3 vols. Trans. Walter Frohlich. (Kalamazoo, Michigan: Cistercian Publications. 1990-1994)
  • Truth, Freedom, and Evil: Three Philosophical Dialogues. Trans. Jasper Hopkins and Herbert Richardson (New York. 1967)
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Trans. Jasper Hopkins and Herbert Richardson (Toronto: Edwin Mellen. 1976). Includes, as v. 4, Jasper Hopkin’s Hermeneutical and Textual Problems in the Complete Treatises of St. Anselm.
  • A New Interpretive Translation of St. Anselm's Monologion and Proslogion. Trans. Jasper Hopkins (Minneapolis: Arthur J. Banning. 1980)
  • The Prayers and Meditations of Saint Anselm. Trans. Benedicta Ward (New York: Penguin Books. 1973)
  • Anselm: Monologion and Proslogion. Trans. Thomas Williams. (Indianapolis: Hackett. 1995)
  • Anselm: Three Philosophical Dialogues. Trans. Thomas Williams. (Indianapolis: Hackett. 2002)


b. Secondary Sources

In addition to the works referenced below, the entirety of the occasional volumes comprising Analecta AnselmianaSpicilegium Beccense, and Anselm Studies are all to be highly recommended, as is The Saint Anselm Journal, which is online and affiliated with the Institute for Saint Anselm Studies.

  • Adams, Marilyn McCord. “Fides Quaerens Intellectum: St. Anselm’s Method In Philosophical Theology,” Faith and Philosophy, vol. 9, n. 4 (1992)
  • Barth, Karl. Anselm: Fides Quaerens Intellectum. Trans. Ian Robertson (Richmond: John Knox Press. 1960)
  • Baumstein, Dom Paschal, O.S.B. “Anselm Agonistes: The Dilemma of a Benedictine Made Bishop,”Faith and Reason, v. 13 (1997-8)
  • Baumstein, Dom Paschal, O.S.B. “Revisiting Anselm: Current Historical Studies and Controversies,”Cistercian Studies Quarterly, v. 28 (1993)
  • Baumstein, Dom Paschal, O.S.B. “St. Anselm and the Prospect of Perfection,” Faith and Reason, v. 29 (2004)
  • Bayert, J, S.J. “The Concept of Mystery According to St. Anselm of Canterbury,” Recherches de Théologie ancienne et médiévale, v. 9 (1937)
  • Châtillon, Jean. “De Guillaume d’Auxerre à S. Thomas d’Aquin: l’argument de S. Anselme chez les premiers scholastiques du XIIIe siècle,” Spicilegium Beccense, v. 1. (Paris: Vrin. 1959)
  • Cohen, Nicholas. “Feudal Imagery or Christian Tradition? A Defense of the Rationale for Anselm’s Cur Deus Homo,” The Saint Anselm Journal, v. 2, n. 1 (2004)
  • Corbin, Michel, S.J. “La significations de l’unum argumentum du Proslogion,” Anselm Studies, vol. 2 (1988)
  • Corbin, Michel, S.J. Prière et raison de la foi: introduction à l’œuvre de S. Anselme de Cantorbéry(Paris: Cerf. 1992)
  • Davies, Brian and Brian Leftow, eds. The Cambridge Companion to Anselm (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 2004)
  • Eadmer. Vita Sancti Anselmi, translated by R.W. Southern as The Life of St. Anselm: Archbishop of Canterbury (London: Thomas Nelson and Sons, Ltd. 1962).
  • Evans, Gillian Rosemary. A Concordance to the Works of St. Anselm (Millwood, New York: Kraus International Publications. 1984)
  • Evans, Gillian Rosemary. Anselm. (Wilton, Connecticut: Morehouse-Barlow. 1989)
  • Evans, Gillian Rosemary. Anselm and a New Generation (Oxford: Clarendon. 1980)
  • Evans, Gillian Rosemary. Anselm and Talking about God (New York: Oxford University Press. 1978)
  • Evans, Gillian Rosemary. “The ‘Secure Technician’: Varieties of Paradox in the Writings of Saint Anselm,” Vivarium, vol. 13 (1975)
  • Fortin, John, O.S.B., ed. Saint Anselm: His Origins and Influence (Lewiston, New York: Edwin Mellen Press. 2001)
  • Gilson, Etienne. “Sens et nature de l’argument de saint Anselme,” Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du Moyen Age, v. 9 (1934)
  • Hartshorne, Charles. Anselm’s Discovery (La Salle, Illinois: Open Court.1965)
  • Henry, D.P. “St Anselm on Scriptural Analysis,” Sophia, v. 1 (1962)
  • Herrera, R.A. Anselm’s Proslogion: An Introduction. (Washington D.C.: University Press of America. 1979)
  • Herrera, R.A. “St. Anselm’s Proslogion: A Hermeneutical Task,” Analecta Anselmiana, vol. 3 (1972)
  • Hick, John and Arthur C. McGill. The Many-faced Argument: Recent Studies on the Ontological Argument for the Existence of God (New York: MacMillan. 1967)
  • Hoegen, Maternus, ed. L’attualità filosofica di Anselmo d’Aosta (Rome: Pontifico Ateno S. Anselemo. 1990)
  • Hopkins, Jasper. A Companion to the Study of St. Anselm (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press. 1972).
  • Koyré, Alexandre. L’idée de Dieu dans la philosophie de St. Anselme (Paris: Editions Ernest Leroux. 1923)
  • Matthews, Scott. Reason, Community and Religious Tradition: Anselm’s Argument and the Friars.(Aldershot: Ashgate: 2001)
  • McEvoy, James “La preuve anselmienne de l’existence de Dieu est-elle ontologique?,” Revue philosophique de Louvain, v. 92, n. 2-3 (1994).
  • McIntyre, J. St. Anselm and His Critics: A Reinterpretation of Cur Deus Homo (London. Edinburgh: Oliver and Boyd. 1954)
  • Paliard, Jacques “Prière et dialectique: Méditation sur le Proslogion de saint Anselme,” Dieu Vivant, v. 6 (1946)
  • Plantinga, Alvin. The Ontological Argument, from St. Anselm to Contemporary Philosophers(Garden City, New York: Anchor Books. 1965)
  • Pouchet, Dom Jean Robert, O.S.B. “Existe-t-il une ‘synthèse’ anselmienne,” Analecta Anselmiana, vol. 1 (1969)
  • Pouchet, Dom Jean Robert, O.S.B. La rectitudo chez saint Anselme: un itinéraire augustinien de l’ame à Dieu (Paris: Etudes Augustiniennes. 1964)
  • Recktenwald, Engelbert. Die ethische Struktur des Denkens von Anselm von Canterbury(Heidelberg: Universitäts Verlag. 1998)
  • Rogers, Katherine. “Can Christianity be Proven? Saint Anselm on Faith and Reason,” Anselm Studies,vol. 2 (1998)
  • Rogers, Katherine. The Anselmian Approach to God and Creation (Lewiston, New York: Edwin Mellen Press. 1997)
  • Rogers, Katherine. The Neoplatonic Metaphysics and Epistemology of Anselm of Canterbury(Lewiston, New York: Edwin Mellen Press. 1997)
  • Rovighi, S. Vanni. “Notes sur l’influence de saint Anselme au XIIe siècle,” Cahiers de Civilization Médiévale, v. 7, n. 4 and v. 8, n. 1 (1964)
  • Sadler, Gregory. “Mercy and Justice in St. Anselm’s Proslogion,” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 80, no. 1 (2006)
  • Sontag, F. “The Meaning of ‘Argument’ in Anselm’s Ontological Proof,” Journal of Philosophy, v. 64, (1968)
  • Southern, R.W. Saint Anselm: A Portrait In Landscape (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 1990)
  • Southern, R.W. Saint Anselm and His Biographer (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 1963)
  • Sweeney, Eileen. “Anselm’s Proslogion: The Desire for the Word,” The Saint Anselm Journal, vol. 1 no. 1 (2003)
  • Thonnard François-Joseph, A.A., “Caractères augustiniens de la méthode philosophique de saint Anselme,” Spicilegium Beccense, v. 1. (Paris: Vrin. 1959)
  • Tonini, Simone. “La scrittura nelle opere sistematische di S. Anselmo: Concetto, Posizione, Significato,”Analecta Anselmiana, vol. 2 (1970), p. 57-116.
  • Van Fletern, Frederick and Joseph C. Schnaubelt, eds. Twenty-Five Years (1969-1994) of Anselm Studies: Review and Critique of Recent Scholarly Views.(Lewiston, New York: Edwin Mellen Press. 1996).
  • Viola, Coloman and Frederick van Fleteren, eds. Saint Anselm – A Thinker for Yesterday and Today (Lewiston, New York: Edwin Mellen Press. 1990).

Author Information

Greg Sadler
Marist College and ReasonIO
U. S. A.

Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888—1975)

Radhakrishnan_SAs an academic, philosopher, and statesman, Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (1888-1975) was one of the most recognized and influential Indian thinkers in academic circles in the 20th century. Throughout his life and extensive writing career, Radhakrishnan sought to define, defend, and promulgate his religion, a religion he variously identified as Hinduism, Vedanta, and the religion of the Spirit. He sought to demonstrate that his Hinduism was both philosophically coherent and ethically viable. Radhakrishnan's concern for experience and his extensive knowledge of the Western philosophical and literary traditions has earned him the reputation of being a bridge-builder between India and the West. He often appears to feel at home in the Indian as well as the Western philosophical contexts, and draws from both Western and Indian sources throughout his writing. Because of this, Radhakrishnan has been held up in academic circles as a representative of Hinduism to the West. His lengthy writing career and his many published works have been influential in shaping the West's understanding of Hinduism, India, and the East.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography and Context
    1. Early Years (1888-1904)
    2. Madras Christian College (1904-1908)
    3. Early Teaching and Writing (1908-1912)
    4. The War, Tagore, and Mysore (1914-1920)
    5. Calcutta and the George V Chair (1921-1931)
    6. The 1930s and 1940s
    7. Post-Independence: Vice-presidency and Presidency
  2. Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan
    1. Metaphysics
    2. Epistemology: Intuition and the Varieties of Experience
      1. Intuition
      2. Varieties of Experience
        1. Cognitive Experience
        2. Psychic Experience
        3. Aesthetic Experience
        4. Ethical Experience
        5. Religious Experience
    3. Religious Pluralism
    4. Authority of Scripture and the Scientific Basis of Hinduism
    5. Practical Mysticism and Applied Ethics
      1. Ethics of Caste
  3. Criticism
    1. Epistemic Authority
    2. Cultural and Religious Constructions
    3. Selectivity of Evidence
  4. List of Abbreviations
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources by Radhakrishnan
    2. Selected Secondary Sources

1. Biography and Context

a. Early Years (1888-1904)

Rather little detail is known of Radhakrishnan's earliest childhood and education. Radhakrishnan rarely spoke about his personal life, and what he does reveal comes to us after several decades of reflection. Radhakrishnan was born in Tirutani, Andhra Pradesh into a brahmin family, likely smarta in religious orientation. Predominantly Hindu, Tirutani was a temple town and popular pilgrimage center, and Radhakrishnan's family were active participants in the devotional activities there. The implicit acceptance of Śaṅkara's Advaita by the smarta tradition is good evidence to suggest that an advaitic framework was an important, though latent, feature of Radhakrishnan's early philosophical and religious sensibilities.

In 1896, Radhakrishnan was sent to school in the nearby pilgrimage center of Tirupati, a town with a distinctively cosmopolitan flavor, drawing bhaktas from all parts of India. For four years, Radhakrishnan attended the Hermannsburg Evangelical Lutheran Missionary school. It was there that the young Radhakrishnan first encountered non-Hindu missionaries and 19th century Christian theology with its impulse toward personal religious experience. The theology taught in the missionary school may have found resonance with the highly devotional activities connected with the nearby Tirumala temple, activities that Radhakrishnan undoubtedly would have witnessed taking place outside the school. The shared emphasis on personal religious experience may have suggested to Radhakrishnan a common link between the religion of the missionaries and the religion practiced at the nearby Tirumala temple.

Between 1900 and 1904, Radhakrishnan attended Elizabeth Rodman Voorhees College in Vellore, a school run by the American Arcot Mission of the Reformed Church in America. The mandate of the Mission was to preach the gospel, to publish vernacular tracts, and to educate the "heathen" masses. It was here, as Robert Minor points out, that Radhakrishnan was "introduced to the Dutch Reform Theology, which emphasized a righteous God, unconditional grace, and election, and which criticized Hinduism as intellectually incoherent and ethically unsound." At the same time, the Mission demonstrated an active concern for education, health care, and social uplift through its participation in famine relief, the establishment of hospitals, and education for all irrespective of social status. Such activities were not inconsistent with the mandate of the Mission as they often served as incentives for conversion. In was in this atmosphere that Radhakrishnan encountered what would have appeared to him as crippling assaults on his Hindu sensibilities. He also would have witnessed the positive contributions of the social programs undertaken by the Mission in the name of propagation of the Christian gospel.

Thus, Radhakrishnan inherited from his upbringing a tacit acceptance of Śaṅkara's Advaita Vedanta and an awareness of the centrality of devotional practices associated with the smarta tradition. His experiences at Tirupati brought him into contact with Lutheran Christian missionaries whose theological emphasis on personal religious experience may have suggested to him a common ground between Christianity and his own religious heritage. In Vellore, the presence of a systematic social gospel was intimately bound up with the religion of those who sought to censure Radhakrishnan's cultural norms and religious worldview.

Radhakrishnan was married to his wife of over 50 years, Sivakamuamma, in 1904 while living in Vellore. The couple went on to have six children: five daughters and a son.

It is in this historical and hermeneutic contexts and with these experiences informing his worldview that Radhakrishnan encountered a resurgent Hinduism. Specifically, Radhakrishnan encountered the writings of Swami Vivekananda and V.D. Savarkar's The First War of Indian Independence. The Theosophical Society was also active in the South Arcot area at this time. The Theosophists not only applauded the ancient wisdom they claimed to have found in India, but were persistent advocates of a philosophical, spiritual, and scientific meeting of East and West. Moreover, the Society's role in the Indian nationalist movement is evidenced by Annie Besant's involvement with the Indian National Congress. While Radhakrishnan does not speak of the Theosophists presence at this time, it is unlikely that he would have been unfamiliar with their views.

What Vivekananda, Savarkar, and Theosophy did bring to Radhakrishnan was a sense of cultural self-confidence and self-reliance. However, the affirmation Radhakrishnan received from this resurgence of Hinduism did not push Radhakrishnan to study philosophy nor to interpret his own religion. It was only after Radhakrishnan's experiences at Madras Christian College that he began to put down in writing his own understanding of Hinduism.

b. Madras Christian College (1904-1908)

In 1904, Radhakrishnan entered Madras Christian College. At this time Radhakrishnan's academic sensibilities lay with the physical sciences, and before beginning his MA degree in 1906 his interest appears to have been law.

Two key influences on Radhakrishnan at Madras Christian College left an indelible stamp on Radhakrishnan's sensibilities. First, it was here that Radhakrishnan was trained in European philosophy. Radhakrishnan was introduced to the philosophies of Berkeley,LeibnizLockeSpinozaKantJ.S. MillHerbert SpencerFichteHegelAristotle, andPlato among others. Radhakrishnan was also introduced to the philosophical methods and theological views of his MA supervisor and most influential non-Indian mentor, Professor A.G. Hogg. Hogg was a Scottish Presbyterian missionary who was educated in the theology of Albrecht Ritschl and studied under the philosopher Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison. As a student of Arthur Titius, himself a student of Albrecht Ritschl, Hogg adopted the Ritschlian distinction between religious value judgments, with their emphasis on subjective perception, and theoretical knowledge, which seeks to discover the nature of ultimate reality. Religious value judgments give knowledge which is different from, though not necessarily opposed to, theoretical knowledge. For Ritschl, and subsequently for Titius and Hogg, this distinction led to the conclusion that doctrines and scriptures are records of personal insights and are therefore necessary for religious, and specifically Christian, faith. This distinction left its mark on Radhakrishnan's philosophical and religious thinking and resonates throughout his writing.

A second key factor shaping Radhakrishnan's sensibilities during this time is that it was at Madras Christian College that Radhakrishnan encountered intense religious polemic in an academic setting. Radhakrishnan later recalled: "The challenge of Christian critics impelled me to make a study of Hinduism and find out what is living and what is dead in it... I prepared a thesis on the Ethics of the Vedanta, which was intended to be a reply to the charge that the Vedanta system had no room for ethics" (MST 19).

c. Early Teaching and Writing (1908-1912)

Upon the completion of his MA degree in 1908, Radhakrishnan found himself at both a financial and professional crossroads. His obligations to his family precluded him from applying for a scholarship to study in Britain and he struggled without success to find work in Madras. The following year, with the assistance of William Skinner at Madras Christian College, Radhakrishnan was able to secure what was intended to be a temporary teaching position at Presidency College in Madras.

At Presidency College, Radhakrishnan lectured on a variety of topics in psychology as well as in European philosophy. As a junior Assistant Professor, logic, epistemology and ethical theory were his stock areas of instruction. At the College, Radhakrishnan also learned Sanskrit.

During these years, Radhakrishnan was anxious to have his work published, not only by Indian presses but also in European journals. The Guardian Press in Madras published his MA thesis, and scarcely revised portions of this work appeared in Modern Review andThe Madras Christian College Magazine. While Radhakrishnan's efforts met with success in other Indian journals, it was not until his article "The Ethics of the Bhagavadgita and Kant" appeared in The International Journal of Ethics in 1911 that Radhakrishnan broke through to a substantial Western audience. As well, his edited lecture notes on psychology were published under the title Essentials of Psychology.

d. The War, Tagore, and Mysore (1914-1920)

By 1914, Radhakrishnan's reputation as a scholar was beginning to grow. However, the security of a permanent academic post in Madras eluded him. For three months in 1916 he was posted to Anantapur, Andhra Pradesh, and in 1917 he was transferred yet again, this time to Rajahmundry. Only after spending a year in Rajahmundry did Radhakrishnan find some degree of professional security upon his acceptance of a position in philosophy at Mysore University. This hiatus in his occupational angst would be short lived. His most prestigious Indian academic appointment to the George V Chair in Philosophy at Calcutta University in February of 1921 would take him out of South India for the first time only two and a half years later.

Between 1914 and 1920, Radhakrishnan continued to publish. He authored eighteen articles, ten of which were published in prominent Western journals such as The International Journal of EthicsThe Monist, and Mind. Throughout these articles, Radhakrishnan took it upon himself to refine and expand upon his interpretation of Hinduism.

There is a strong polemical tenor to many of these articles. Radhakrishnan was no longer content simply to define and defend Vedanta. Instead, he sought to confront directly not only Vedanta's Western competitors, but what he saw as the Western philosophical enterprise and the Western ethos in general.

Radhakrishnan's polemical sensibilities during these years were heightened in no small part by the political turmoil both on the Indian as well as on the world stage. Radhakrishnan's articles and books during this period reflect his desire to offer a sustainable philosophical response to the unfolding discontent he encountered. World War One and its aftermath, and in particular the events in Amritsar in the spring of 1919, further exacerbated Radhakrishnan's patience with what he saw as an irrational, dogmatic, and despotic West. Radhakrishnan's 1920 The Reign of Religion in Contemporary Philosophy is indicative of his heightened polemical sensibilities during this period.

A more positive factor in Radhakrishnan's life during these years was his reading of Rabindranath Tagore, the Bengali poet. Radhakrishnan joined the rest of the English-speaking world in 1912 in reading Tagore's translated works. Though the two had never met at this time, Tagore would become perhaps Radhakrishnan's most influential Indian mentor. Tagore's poetry and prose resonated with Radhakrishnan. He appreciated Tagore's emphasis on aesthetics as well as his appeal to intuition. From 1914 on, both of these notions -- aesthetics and intuition -- begin to find their place in Radhakrishnan's own interpretations of experience, the epistemological category for his philosophical and religious proclivities. Over the next five decades, Radhakrishnan would repeatedly appeal to Tagore's writing to support his own philosophical ideals.

e. Calcutta and the George V Chair (1921-1931)

In 1921, Radhakrishnan took up the prestigious George V Chair in Philosophy at Calcutta University. As an honored, though hesitant, heir to Brajendranath Seal, Radhakrishnan's appointment to the chair was not without its dissenters who sought a fellow Bengali for the position. In Calcutta, Radhakrishnan was for the first time out of his South Indian element -- geographically, culturally, and linguistically.

However, the isolation Radhakrishnan experienced during his early years in Calcutta allowed him to work on his two volume Indian Philosophy, the first of which he began while in Mysore and published in 1923 and the second followed four years later. Throughout the 1920s, Radhakrishnan's reputation as a scholar continued to grow both in India and abroad. He was invited to Oxford to give the 1926 Upton Lectures, published in 1927 as The Hindu View of Life, and in 1929 Radhakrishnan delivered theHibbert Lectures, later published under the title An Idealist View of Life. The later of these two Views is Radhakrishnan's most sustained, non-commentarial work. An Idealist View of Life is frequently seen as Radhakrishnan's mature work and has undoubtedly received the bulk of scholarly attention on Radhakrishnan.

While Radhakrishnan enjoyed a growing scholarly repute, he was also confronted in Calcutta with growing conflict and confrontation. The events of Amritsar in 1919 did little to encourage positive relations between Indians and the British Raj; and Gandhi's on again-off again Rowlatt satyagraha was proving ineffective in cultivating a united Indian voice. The ambiguity of the Montagu-Chelmsford Reforms with their olive branch for "responsible government" further fragmented an already divided Congress. The Khalifat movement splintered the Indian Muslim community, and aggravated the growing animosity between its supporters and those, Muslim or otherwise, who saw it as a side issue to swaraj (self-rule). But the racial paternalism of the 1927 Simon Commission prompted a resurgence of nationalist sentiment. While Indian solidarity and protest received international attention, due in no small part to the media coverage of Gandhi's Salt March, such national unity was readily shaken. Indian political consensus, much less swaraj, proved elusive. Communal division and power struggles on the part of Indians and a renewed conservatism in Britain crippled the London Round Table Conferences of the early 1930s, reinforcing and perpetuating an already highly fragmented and politically volatile India.

With the publication of An Idealist View of Life, Radhakrishnan had come into his own philosophically. In his mind, he had identified the "religious" problem, reviewed the alternatives, and posited a solution. An unreflective dogmatism could not be remedied by escaping from "experiential religion" which is the true basis of all religions. Rather, a recognition of the creative potency of integral experience tempered by a critical scientific attitude was, Radhakrishnan believed, the only viable corrective to dogmatic claims of exclusivity founded on external, second-hand authority. Moreover, while Hinduism (Advaita Vedanta) as he defined it best exemplified his position, Radhakrishnan claimed that the genuine philosophical, theological, and literary traditions in India and the West supported his position.

f. The 1930s and 1940s

Radhakrishnan was knighted in 1931, the same year he took up his administrative post as Vice Chancellor at the newly founded, though scarcely constructed, Andhra University at Waltair. Sir Radhakrishnan served there for five years as Vice Chancellor, when, in 1936, not only did the university in Calcutta affirm his position in perpetuity but Oxford University appointed him to the H.N. Spalding Chair of Eastern Religions and Ethics. In late 1939, Radhakrishnan took up his second Vice Chancellorship at Benares Hindu University (BHU), and served there during the course of the second world war until mid-January 1948, two weeks before Gandhi's assassination in New Delhi.

Shortly after his resignation from BHU, Radhakrishnan was named chairman of the University Education Commission. The Commission's 1949 Report assessed the state of university education and made recommendations for its improvement in the newly independent India. Though co-authored by others, Radhakrishnan's hand is felt especially in the chapters on The Aims of University Education and Religious Education.

During these years, the question of nationalism occupied Radhakrishnan's attention. The growing communalism Radhakrishnan had witnessed in the 1920s was further intensified with the ideological flowering of the Hindu Mahasabha under the leadership of Bhai Parmanand and his heir V.D. Savarkar. Likewise, Muhammad Iqbal's 1930 poetic vision and call for Muslim self-assertion furnished Muhammad Jinnah with an ideological template in which to lay claim to an independent Pakistan. This claim was given recognition at the Round Table Conferences in London early that decade. If the Montagu-Chelmsford Reforms had in the 1920s served to fracture already fragile political alliances, its 1935 progeny as the Government of India Act with its promise for greater self-government further crowded the political stage and divided those groups struggling for their share of power. During these years, the spectrum of nationalist vision was as broad as Indian solidarity was elusive.

The issues of education and nationalism come together for Radhakrishnan during this period. For Radhakrishnan, a university education which quickened the development of the whole individual was the only responsible and practical means to the creation of Indian solidarity and clarity of national vision. Throughout the 1930s and 1940s, Radhakrishnan expressed his vision of an autonomous India. He envisioned an India built and guided by those who were truly educated, by those who had a personal vision of and commitment to raising Indian self-consciousness.

g. Post-Independence: Vice-presidency and Presidency

The years following Indian independence mark Radhakrishnan's increasing involvement in Indian political as well as in international affairs. The closing years of the 1940s were busy ones. Radhakrishnan had been actively involved in the newly incorporated UNESCO (United Nations Educational, Scientific, and Cultural Organization), serving on its Executive Board as well as leading the Indian delegation from 1946-1951. Radhakrishnan also served for the two years immediately following India's independence as a member of the Indian Constituent Assembly. Radhakrishnan's time and energy to UNESCO and the Constituent Assembly had also to be shared by the demands of the University Commission and his continuing obligations as Spalding Professor at Oxford.

With the Report of the Universities Commission complete in 1949, Radhakrishnan was appointed by then Prime Minister Jawaharlal Nehru as Indian Ambassador to Moscow, a post he held until 1952. The opportunity for Radhakrishnan to put into practice his own philosophical-political ideals came with his election to the Raja Sabha, in which he served as India's Vice-President (1952-1962) and later as President (1962-1967).

Radhakrishnan saw during his terms in office an increasing need for world unity and universal fellowship. The urgency of this need was pressed home to Radhakrishnan by what he saw as the unfolding crises throughout the world. At the time of his taking up the office of Vice-President, the Korean war was already in full swing. Political tensions with China in the early 1960s followed by the hostilities between India and Pakistan dominated Radhakrishnan's presidency. Moreover, the Cold War divided East and West leaving each side suspicious of the other and on the defensive.

Radhakrishnan challenged what he saw as the divisive potential and dominating character of self-professed international organizations such as the League of Nations. Instead, he called for the promotion of a creative internationalism based on the spiritual foundations of integral experience. Only then could understanding and tolerance between peoples and between nations be promoted.

Radhakrishnan retired from public life in 1967. He spent the last eight years of his life at the home he built in Mylapore, Madras. Radhakrishnan died on April 17, 1975.

2. Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan

a. Metaphysics

Radhakrishnan located his metaphysics within the Advaita (non-dual) Vedanta tradition (sampradaya). And like other Vedantins before him, Radhakrishnan wrote commentaries on the Prasthanatraya (that is, main primary texts of Vedanta ): the Upanisads (1953),Brahma Sutra (1959), and the Bhagavadgita (1948).

As an Advaitin, Radhakrishnan embraced a metaphysical idealism. But Radhakrishnan's idealism was such that it recognized the reality and diversity of the world of experience (prakṛti) while at the same time preserving the notion of a wholly transcendent Absolute (Brahman), an Absolute that is identical to the self (Atman). While the world of experience and of everyday things is certainly not ultimate reality as it is subject to change and is characterized by finitude and multiplicity, it nonetheless has its origin and support in the Absolute (Brahman) which is free from all limits, diversity, and distinctions (nirguṇa). Brahman is the source of the world and its manifestations, but these modes do not affect the integrity of Brahman.

In this vein, Radhakrishnan did not merely reiterate the metaphysics of Śaṅkara (8th century C.E.), arguably Advaita Vedanta's most prominent and enduring figure, but sought to reinterpret Advaita for present needs. In particular, Radhakrishnan reinterpreted what he saw as Śaṅkara's understanding of maya strictly as illusion. For Radhakrishnan, maya ought not to be understood to imply a strict objective idealism, one in which the world is taken to be inherently disconnected from Brahman, but rather mayaindicates, among other things, a subjective misperception of the world as ultimately real. [See Donald Braue, Maya in Radhakrishnan's Thought: Six Meanings Other Than Illusion(1985) for a full treatment of this issue.]

b. Epistemology: Intuition and the Varieties of Experience

This section deals with Radhakrishnan's understanding of intuition and his interpretations of experience. It begins with a general survey of the variety of terms as well as the characteristics Radhakrishnan associates with intuition. It then details with how Radhakrishnan understands specific occurrences of intuition in relation to other forms of experience -- cognitive, psychic, aesthetic, ethical, and religious.

i. Intuition

Radhakrishnan associates a vast constellation of terms with intuition. At its best, intuition is an "integral experience". Radhakrishnan uses the term "integral" in at least three ways. First, intuition is integral in the sense that it coordinates and synthesizes all other experiences. It integrates all other experiences into a more unified whole. Second, intuition is integral as it forms the basis of all other experiences. In other words, Radhakrishnan holds that all experiences are at bottom intuitional. Third, intuition is integral in the sense that the results of the experience are integrated into the life of the individual. For Radhakrishnan, intuition finds expression in the world of action and social relations.

At times Radhakrishnan prefers to emphasize the "mystical" and "spiritual" quality of intuition as attested to by the expressions "religious experience" (IVL 91), "religious consciousness" (IVL 199), "mystical experience" (IVL 88), "spiritual idealism" (IVL 87), "self-existent spiritual experience" (IVL 99), "prophetic indications" and "the real ground in man's deepest being" (IVL 103), "spiritual apprehension" (IVL 103), "moments of vision" (IVL 94), "revelation" (IVL 210), "supreme light" (IVL 206), and even "faith" (IVL 199). But it is the creative potency of intuition, designated by Radhakrishnan's reference to the "creative center" of the individual (IVL 113), "creative intuition" (IVL 205), "creative spirit" (IVL 206), and "creative energy" (IVL 205), that is the lynchpin for Radhakrishnan's understanding of intuition. As Radhakrishnan understands it, all progress is the result of the creative potency of intuition.

For Radhakrishnan, intuition is a distinct form of experience. Intuition is of a self-certifying character (svatassiddha). It is sufficient and complete. It is self-established (svatasiddha), self-evidencing (svāsaṃvedya), and self-luminous (svayam-prakāsa) (IVL 92). Intuition entails pure comprehension, entire significance, complete validity (IVL 93). It is both truth-filled and truth-bearing (IVL 93). Intuition is its own cause and its own explanation (IVL 92). It is sovereign (IVL 92). Intuition is a positive feeling of calm and confidence, joy and strength (IVL 93). Intuition is profoundly satisfying (IVL 93). It is peace, power and joy (IVL 93).

Intuition is the ultimate form of experience for Radhakrishnan. It is ultimate in the sense that intuition constitutes the fullest and therefore the most authentic realization of the Real (Brahman). The ultimacy of intuition is also accounted for by Radhakrishnan in that it is the ground of all other forms of experience.

Intuition is a self-revelation of the divine. Intuitive experience is immediate. Immediacy does not imply in Radhakrishnan's mind an "absence of psychological mediation, but only non-mediation by conscious thought" (IVL 98). Intuition operates on a supra-conscious level, unmediated as it is by conscious thought. Even so, Radhakrishnan holds that there is "no such thing as pure experience, raw and undigested. It is always mixed up with layers of interpretation" (IVL 99). One might object here that Radhakrishnan has conflated the experience itself with its subsequent interpretation and expression. However, Radhakrishnan's comment is an attempt to deny the Hegelian interpretation of Hinduism's "contentless" experience, affirming instead that intuition is the plenitude of experience.

Finally, intuition, according to Radhakrishnan, is ineffable. It escapes the limits of language and logic, and there is "no conception by which we can define it" (IVL 96). In such experiences "[t]hought and reality coalesce and a creative merging of subject and object results" (IVL 92). While the experience itself transcends expression, it also provokes it (IVL 95). The provocation of expression is, for Radhakrishnan, testimony to the creative impulse of intuition. All creativity and indeed all progress in the various spheres of life is the inevitable result of intuition.

ii. Varieties of Experience

1) Cognitive Experience

Radhakrishnan recognizes three categories of cognitive experience: sense experience, discursive reasoning, and intuitive apprehension. For Radhakrishnan all of these forms of experience contribute, in varying degrees, to a knowledge of the real (Brahman), and as such have their basis in intuition.

Sense Experience

Of the cognitive forms of knowledge, Radhakrishnan suggests that sensory knowledge is in one respect closest to intuition, for it is in the act of sensing that one is in "direct contact" with the object. Sense experience "helps us to know the outer characters of the external world. By means of it we acquire an acquaintance with the sensible qualities of the objects" (IVL 134). "Intuitions," Radhakrishnan believes, "are convictions arising out of a fullness of life in a spontaneous way, more akin to sense than to imagination or intellect and more inevitable than either" (IVL 180). In this sense, sense perception may be considered intuitive, though Radhakrishnan does not explicitly describe it as such.

Discursive Reasoning

Discursive reasoning, and the logical knowledge it produces, is subsequent to sensory experience (perception). "Logical knowledge is obtained by the processes of analysis and synthesis. Unlike sense perception which Radhakrishnan claims to be closer to direct knowledge, logical knowledge "is indirect and symbolic in its character. It helps us to handle and control the object and its workings" (IVL 134). There is a paradoxical element here. Radhakrishnan seems to be suggesting that the direct proximity to an external object one encounters in sense perception is compromised when the perception is interpreted and subsequently incorporated into a more systematic, though presumably higher, form of knowledge through discursive reasoning.

For Radhakrishnan, discursive reasoning and the logical systems they construct possess an element of intuition. The methodical, mechanical working through of logical problems and the reworking of rational systems cannot be divorced from what Radhakrishnan might call an "intuitive hunch" that such a course of action will bear positive results; "In any concrete act of thinking the mind's active experience is both intuitive and intellectual" (IVL 181-182).

Intuitive Apprehension

Radhakrishnan argues against what he sees as the prevalent (Western) temptation to reduce the intuitive to the logical. While logic deals with facts already known, intuition goes beyond logic to reveal previously unseen connections between facts. "The art of discovery is confused with the logic of proof and an artificial simplification of the deeper movements of thought results. We forget that we invent by intuition though we prove by logic" (IVL 177). Intuition not only clarifies the relations between facts and seemingly discordant systems, but lends itself to the discovery of new knowledge which then becomes an appropriate subject of philosophical inquiry and logical analysis.

Claiming to take his cue from his former adversary Henri Bergson, Radhakrishnan offers three explanations to account for the tendency to overlook the presence of intuition in discursive reasoning. First, Radhakrishnan claims, intuition presupposes a rational knowledge of facts. "The insight does not arise if we are not familiar with the facts of the case.... The successful practice of intuition requires previous study and assimilation of a multitude of facts and laws. We may take it that great intuitions arise out of a matrix of rationality" (IVL 177). Second, the intuitive element is often obscured in discursive reasoning because facts known prior to the intuition are retained, though they are synthesized, and perhaps reinterpreted, in light of the intuitive insight. "The readjustment [of previously known facts] is so easy that when the insight is attained it escapes notice and we imagine that the process of discovery is only rational synthesis" (IVL 177). Finally, intuition in discursive reasoning is often overlooked, disguised as it is in the language of logic. In short, the intuitive is mistaken for the logical. "Knowledge when acquired must be thrown into logical form and we are obliged to adopt the language of logic since only logic has a communicable language." This last is a perplexing claim since elsewhere Radhakrishnan clearly recognizes that meaning is conveyed in symbols, poetry, and metaphors. Perhaps what Radhakrishnan means is that logic is the only valid means by which we are able to organize and systematize empirical facts. Regardless, according to Radhakrishnan, the presentation of facts in logical form contributes to "a confusion between discovery and proof" (IVL 177).

Conversely, Radhakrishnan offers a positive argument for the place of intuition in discursive reasoning. "If the process of discovery were mere synthesis, any mechanical manipulator of prior partial concepts would have reached the insight and it would not have taken a genius to arrive at it" (IVL 178). A purely mechanical account of discursive reasoning ignores the inherently creative and dynamic dimension of intuitive insight. In Radhakrishnan's view the mechanical application of logic alone is creatively empty (IVL 181).

However, Radhakrishnan holds that the "creative insight is not the final link in a chain of reasoning. If it were that, it would not strike us as "inspired in its origin" (IVL 178). Intuition is not the end, but part of an ever-developing and ever-dynamic process of realization. There is, for Radhakrishnan, a continual system of "checks and balances" between intuition and the logical method of discursive reasoning. Cognitive intuitions "are not substitutes for thought, they are challenges to intelligence. Mere intuitions are blind while intellectual work is empty. All processes are partly intuitive and partly intellectual. There is no gulf between the two" (IVL 181).

2) Psychic Experience

Perhaps the most understudied dimension of Radhakrishnan's interpretations of experience is his recognition of "supernormal" experiences. As early as his first volume of Indian Philosophy (1923), Radhakrishnan affirms the validity of what he identifies as "psychic phenomena". Radhakrishnan accounts for such experiences in terms of a highly developed sensitivity to intuition. "The mind of man," Radhakrishnan explains, "has the three aspects of subconscious, the conscious, and the superconscious, and the ‘abnormal' psychic phenomena, called by the different names of ecstasy, genius, inspiration, madness, are the workings of the superconscious mind" (IP1 28). Such experiences are not "abnormal" according to Radhakrishnan, nor are they unscientific. Rather, they are the products of carefully controlled mental experiments. In the Indian past, "The psychic experiences, such as telepathy and clairvoyance, were considered to be neither abnormal nor miraculous. They are not the products of diseased minds or inspiration from the gods, but powers which the human mind can exhibit under carefully ascertained conditions" (IP1 28). Psychic intuitions are not askew with Radhakrishnan's understanding of the intellect. In fact, they are evidence of the remarkable heights to which the undeveloped, limited intellect is capable. They are, for Radhakrishnan, accomplishments rather than failures of human consciousness.

As highly developed powers of apprehension, psychic experiences are a state of consciousness "beyond the understanding of the normal, and the supernormal is traced to the supernatural" (IVL 94). Moreover, in what Radhakrishnan might recognize as an "intuitive hunch" in the articulation of a new scientific hypothesis, psychic premonitions, as partial or momentary as they may be, lend themselves to the "psychic hypothesis" that the universal spirit is inherent in the nature of all things (IVL 110). For Radhakrishnan, psychic intuitions are suprasensory: "We can see objects without the medium of the senses and discern relations spontaneously without building them up laboriously. In other words, we can discern every kind of reality directly" (IVL 143). In a bold, albeit highly problematic, declaration, Radhakrishnan believes that the "facts of telepathy prove that one mind can communicate with another directly"(IVL 143).

3) Aesthetic Experience

"All art," Radhakrishnan declares, "is the expression of experience in some medium" (IVL 182). However, the artistic experience should not be confused with its expression. While the experience itself is ineffable, the challenge for the artist is to give the experience concrete expression. "The success of art is measured by the extent to which it is able to render experiences of one dimension into terms of another. (IVL 187) For Radhakrishnan, art born out of a "creative contemplation which is a process of travail of the spirit is an authentic "crystallization of a life process" (IVL 185). At its ultimate and in its essence, the "poetical character is derived from the creative intuition (that is, integral intuition) which holds sound, suggestion and sense in organic solution" (IVL 191).

In Radhakrishnan's view, without the intuitive experience, art becomes mechanical and a rehearsal of old themes. Such "art" is an exercise in (re)production rather than a communication of the artist's intuitive encounter with reality. "Technique without inspiration," Radhakrishnan declares, "is barren. Intellectual powers, sense facts and imaginative fancies may result in clever verses, repetition of old themes, but they are only manufactured poetry" (IVL 188). It is not simply a difference of quality but a "difference of kind in the source itself" (IVL 189). For Radhakrishnan, true art is an expression of the whole personality, seized as it was with the creative impulse of the universe.

Artistic intuition mitigates and subdues rational reflection. But "[e]ven in the act of composition," Radhakrishnan believes, "the poet is in a state in which the reflective elements are subordinated to the intuitive. The vision, however, is not operative for so long as it continues, its very stress acts as a check on expression" (IVL 187).

For Radhakrishnan, artistic expression is dynamic. Having had the experience, the artist attempts to recall it. The recollection of the intuition, Radhakrishnan believes, is not a plodding reconstruction, nor one of dispassionate analysis. Rather, there is an emotional vibrancy: "The experience is recollected not in tranquility... but in excitement" (IVL 187). To put the matter somewhat differently, the emotional vibrancy of the aesthetic experience gives one knowledge by being rather than knowledge by knowing (IVL 184).

Art and Science

There is in Radhakrishnan's mind a "scientific" temperament to genuine artistic expression. In what might be called the science of art, Radhakrishnan believes that the "experience or the vision is the artist's counterpart to the scientific discovery of a principle or law" (IVL 184). There is a concordance of agendas in art and science. "What the scientist does when he discovers a new law is to give a new ordering to observed facts. The artist is engaged in a similar task. He gives new meaning to our experience and organizes it in a different way due to his perception of subtler qualities in reality" (IVL 194).

Despite this synthetic impulse, Radhakrishnan is careful to explain that the two disciplines are not wholly the same. The difference turns on what he sees as the predominantly aesthetic and qualitative nature of artistic expression. "Poetic truth is different from scientific truth since it reveals the real in its qualitative uniqueness and not in its quantitative universality" (IVL 193). Presumably, Radhakrishnan means that, unlike the universal laws with which science attempts to grapple, art is much more subjective, not in its creative origin, but in its expression. A further distinction between the two may lend further insight into Radhakrishnan's open appreciation for the poetic medium. "Poetry," he believes, "is the language of the soul, while prose is the language of science. The former is the language of mystery, of devotion, of religion. Prose lays bare its whole meaning to the intelligence, while poetry plunges us in the mysterium tremendum of life and suggests the truths that cannot be stated" (IVL 191).

4) Ethical Experience

Not surprisingly, intuition finds a place in Radhakrishnan's ethics. For Radhakrishnan, ethical experiences are profoundly transformative. The experience resolves dilemmas and harmonizes seemingly discordant paths of possible action. "If the new harmony glimpsed in the moments of insight is to be achieved, the old order of habits must be renounced" (IVL 114). Moral intuitions result in "a redemption of our loyalties and a remaking of our personalities" (IVL 115).

That Radhakrishnan conceives of the ethical development of the individual as a form of conversion is noteworthy as it underscores Radhakrishnan's identification of ethics and religion. For Radhakrishnan, an ethical transformation of the kind brought about by intuition is akin to religious growth and heightened realization. The force of this view is underscored by Radhakrishnan's willing acceptance of the interchangeability of the terms "intuition" and "religious experience".

Of course, not all ethical decisions or actions possess the quality of being guided by an intuitive impulse. Radhakrishnan willingly concedes that the vast majority of moral decisions are the result of conformity to well-established moral codes. However, it is in times of moral crisis that the creative force of ethical intuitions come to the fore. In a less famous, though thematically reminiscent analogy, Radhakrishnan accounts for growth of moral consciousness in terms of the creative intuitive impulse: "In the chessboard of life, the different pieces have powers which vary with the context and the possibilities of their combination are numerous and unpredictable. The sound player has a sense of right and feels that, if he does not follow it, he will be false to himself. In any critical situation the forward move is a creative act" (IVL 196-197).

By definition, moral actions are socially rooted. As such the effects of ethical intuitions are played out on the social stage. While the intuition itself is an individual achievement, Radhakrishnan's view is that the intuition must be not only translated into positive and creative action but shared with others. There is a sense of urgency, if not inevitability, about this. Radhakrishnan tells us one "cannot afford to be absolutely silent" (IVL 97) and the saints "love because they cannot help it" (IVL 116).

The impulse to share the moral insight provides an opportunity to test the validity of the intuition against reason. The moral hero, as Radhakrishnan puts it, does not live by intuition alone. The intuitive experience, while it is the creative guiding impulse behind all moral progress, must be checked and tested against reason. There is a "scientific" and "experimental" dimension to Radhakrishnan's understanding of ethical behavior. Those whose lives are profoundly transformed and who are guided by the ethical experience are, for Radhakrishnan, moral heroes. To Radhakrishnan's mind, the moral hero, guided as he or she is by the ethical experience, who carves out an adventurous path is akin to the discoverer who brings order into the scattered elements of a science or the artist who composes a piece of music or designs buildings" (IVL 196). In a sense, there is very much an art and science to ethical living.

Radhakrishnan's moral heroes, having developed a "large impersonality" (IVL 116) in which the joy, freedom and bliss of a life uninhibited by the constraints of ego and individuality are realized, become "self-sacrificing" exemplars for others. "Feeling the unity of himself and the universe, the man who lives in spirit is no more a separate and self-centered individual but a vehicle of the universal spirit" (IVL 115). Like the artist, the moral hero does not turn his back on the world. Instead, "[h]e throws himself on the world and lives for its redemption, possessed as he is with an unshakable sense of optimism and an unlimited faith in the powers of the soul" (IVL 116). In short, Radhakrishnan's moral hero is a conduit whose "world-consciousness" delights "in furthering the plan of the cosmos" (IVL 116).

Radhakrishnan believes that ethical intuitions at their deepest transcend conventional and mechanically constructed ethical systems. Moral heroes exemplify Radhakrishnan's ethical ideal while at the same time provoking in those who accept the ethical status quo to evaluate and to reconsider less than perfect moral codes. As the moral hero is "fighting for the reshaping of his own society on sounder lines [his] behavior might offend the sense of decorum of the cautious conventionalist" (IVL 197). The contribution of ethically realized individuals is their promotion of moral progress in the world. "Though morality commands conformity, all moral progress is due to nonconformists" (IVL 197). The moral hero is no longer guided by external moral codes, but by an "inner rhythm" of harmony between self and the universe revealed to him in the intuitive experience. "By following his deeper nature, he may seem to be either unwise or unmoral to those of us who adopt conventional standards. But for him the spiritual obligation is more of a consequence than social tradition" (IVL 197).

5) Religious Experience

For the sake of clarity, we must at the outset make a tentative distinction between religious experience on the one hand and integral experience on the other. Radhakrishnan's distinction between "religion" and "religions" will be helpful here. At its most basic, religions, for Radhakrishnan, represent the various interpretations of experience, while integral experience is the essence of all religions. "If experience is the soul of religion, expression is the body through which it fulfills its destiny. We have the spiritual facts and their interpretations by which they are communicated to others" (IVL 90). "It is the distinction between immediacy and thought. Intuitions abide, while interpretations change" (IVL 90). But the interpretations should not be confused with the experiences themselves. For Radhakrishnan, "[c]onceptual expressions are tentative and provisional... [because] the intellectual accounts... are constructed theories of experience" (IVL 119). And he cautions us to "distinguish between the immediate experience or intuition which might conceivably be infallible and the interpretation which is mixed up with it" (IVL 99).

For Radhakrishnan, the creeds and theological formulations of religion are but intellectual representations and symbols of experience. "The idea of God," Radhakrishnan affirms, "is an interpretation of experience" (IVL 186). It follows here that religious experiences are, for Radhakrishnan, context relative and therefore imperfect. They are informed by and experienced through specific cultural, historical, linguistic and religious lenses. Because of their contextuality and subsequent intellectualization, experiences in the religious sphere are limited. It is in this sense that we may refer to experiences which occur under the auspices of one or other of the religions as "religious experiences". Radhakrishnan spends little time dealing with "religious experiences" as they occur in specific religious traditions. And what little he does say is used to demonstrate the theological preconditioning and "religious" relativity of such experiences. However, "religious experiences" have value for Radhakrishnan insofar as they offer the possibility of heightening one's religious consciousness and bringing one into ever closer proximity to "religious intuition".

Much to the confusion and chagrin of readers of Radhakrishnan, Radhakrishnan uses "religious experience" to refer to such "sectarian" religious experiences (as discussed immediately above) as well as to refer to "religious intuitions" which transcend narrow sectarian and religious boundaries and are identical to intuition itself (taken up in the section on "Intuition" above (B.I.) and revisited immediately below).

Radhakrishnan is explicit and emphatic in his view that religious intuition is a unique form of experience. Religious intuition is more than simply the confluence of the cognitive, aesthetic, and ethical sides of life. However vital and significant these sides of life may be, they are but partial and fragmented constituents of a greater whole, a whole which is experienced in its fullness and immediacy in religious intuition.

To Radhakrishnan's mind, religious intuition is not only an autonomous form of experience, but a form of experience which informs and validates all spheres of life and experience. Philosophical, artistic, and ethical values of truth, beauty, and goodness are not known through the senses or by reason. Rather, "they are apprehended by intuition or faith..." (IVL 199-200). For Radhakrishnan, religious intuition informs, conjoins, and transcends an otherwise fragmentary consciousness.

Informing Radhakrishnan's interpretation of religious intuition is his affirmation of the identity of the self and ultimate reality. Throughout his life, Radhakrishnan interpreted the Upaniṣadic mahavakya, tat tvam asi, as a declaration of the non-duality (advaita) of Atman and Brahman. His advaitic interpretation allows him to affirm the ineffability of the truth behind the formula. Radhakrishnan readily appropriates his acceptance of the non-dual experience to his interpretation of religious intuition. Radhakrishnan not only claimed to find support for his views in the Upaniṣads, but believed that, correctly understood, the ancient sages expounded his interpretation of religious intuition. Any attempt at interpretation of the intuition could only approximate the truth of the experience itself. As the ultimate realization, religious intuition must not only account for and bring together all other forms of experience, but must overcome the distinctions between them. Radhakrishnan goes so far as to claim that intuition of this sort is the essence of religion. All religions are informed by it, though all fail to varying degrees to interpret it. "Here we find the essence of religion, which is a synthetic realization of life. The religious man has the knowledge that everything is significant, the feeling that there is harmony underneath the conflicts and the power to realize the significance and the harmony" (IVL 201).

With this, the present discussion of intuition and the varieties of experience has come full circle. Radhakrishnan identifies intuition -- in all its contextual varieties -- with integral experience. The two expressions are, for Radhakrishnan, synonymous. Integral experience coordinates and synthesizes the range of life's experiences. It furnishes the individual with an ever-deepening awareness of and appreciation for the unity of Reality. As an intuition, integral experience is not only the basis of all experience but the source of all creative ingenuity, whether such innovation be philosophical, scientific, moral, artistic, or religious. Moreover, not only does integral experience find expression in these various spheres of life, but such expression, Radhakrishnan believes, quickens the intuitive and creative impulse among those it touches.

c. Religious Pluralism

Radhakrishnan's hierarchy of religions is well-known. "Hinduism," Radhakrishnan affirms, "accepts all religious notions as facts and arranges them in the order of their more or less intrinsic significance": "The worshippers of the Absolute are the highest in rank; second to them are the worshippers of the personal God; then come the worshippers of the incarnations like Rama, Kṛṣṇa, Buddha; below them are those who worship ancestors, deities and sages, and the lowest of all are the worshippers of the petty forces and spirits" (HVL 32).

Radhakrishnan uses his distinctions between experience and interpretation, between religion and religions, to correlate his brand of Hinduism (that is, Advaita Vedanta ) with religion itself. "Religion," Radhakrishnan holds, is "a kind of life or experience." It is an insight into the nature of reality (darsana), or experience of reality (anubhava). It is "a specific attitude of the self, itself and not other" (HVL 15). In a short, but revealing passage, Radhakrishnan characterizes religion in terms of "personal experience." It is "an independent functioning of the human mind, something unique, possessing and autonomous character. It is something inward and personal which unifies all values and organizes all experiences. It is the reaction to the whole of man to the whole of reality. [It] may be called spiritual life, as distinct from a merely intellectual or moral or aesthetic activity or a combination of them" (IVL 88-89).

For Radhakrishnan, integral intuitions are the authority for, and the soul of, religion (IVL 89-90). It is here that we find a critical coalescence of ideas in Radhakrishnan's thinking. If, as Radhakrishnan claims, personal intuitive experience and inner realization are the defining features of Advaita Vedanta , and those same features are the "authority" and "soul" of religion as he understands it, Radhakrishnan is able to affirm with the confidence he does: "The Vedanta is not a religion, but religion itself in its most universal and deepest significance" (HVL 23).

For Radhakrishnan, Hinduism at its Vedantic best is religion. Other religions, including what Radhakrishnan understands as lower forms of Hinduism, are interpretations of Advaita Vedanta . Religion and religions are related in Radhakrishnan's mind as are experience and interpretation. The various religions are merely interpretations of his Vedanta. In a sense, Radhakrishnan "Hinduizes" all religions. Radhakrishnan appropriates traditional exegetical categories to clarify further the relationship: "We have spiritual facts and their interpretations by which they are communicated to others, śruti or what is heard, and smṛti or what is remembered. Śaṅkara equates them with pratyakṣa or intuition and anumana or inference. It is the distinction between immediacy and thought. Intuitions abide, while interpretations change" (IVL 90).

The apologetic force of this brief statement is clear. For Radhakrishnan, the intuitive, experiential immediacy of Advaita Vedanta is the genuine authority for all religions, and all religions as intellectually mediated interpretations derive from and must ultimately defer to Advaita Vedanta . Put succinctly: "While the experiential character of religion is emphasized in the Hindu faith, every religion at its best falls back on it" (IVL 90).

For Radhakrishnan, the religions are not on an even footing in their approximations and interpretations of a common experience. To the extent that all traditions are informed by what Radhakrishnan claims to be a common ground of experience (that is, Advaita Vedanta ), each religion has value. At the same time, all religions as interpretations leave room for development and spiritual progress. "While no tradition coincides with experience, every tradition is essentially unique and valuable. While all traditions are of value, none is finally binding" (IVL 120). Moreover, according to Radhakrishnan, the value of each religion is determined by its proximity to Radhakrishnan's understanding of Vedanta.

d. Authority of Scripture and the Scientific Basis of Hinduism

Radhakrishnan argues that Hinduism, as he understands it, is a scientific religion. According to Radhakrishnan, "[i]f philosophy of religion is to become scientific, it must become empirical and found itself on religious experience" (IVL 184). True religion, argues Radhakrishnan, remains open to experience and encourages an experimental attitude with regard to its experiential data. Hinduism more than any other religion exemplifies this scientific attitude. "The Hindu philosophy of religion starts from and returns to an experimental basis" (HVL 19). Unlike other religions, which set limits on the types of spiritual experience, the "Hindu thinker readily admits of other points of view than his own and considers them to be just as worthy of attention" (HVL 19). What sets Hinduism apart from other religions is its unlimited appeal to and appreciation for all forms of experience. Experience and experimentation are the origin and end of Hinduism, as Radhakrishnan understand it.

Radhakrishnan argues that a scientific attitude has been the hallmark of Hinduism throughout its history. In a revealing passage, Radhakrishnan explains: "The truths of the ṛṣis are not evolved as the result of logical reasoning or systematic philosophy but are the products of spiritual intuition, dṛṣti or vision. The ṛṣis are not so much the authors of the truths recorded in the Vedas as the seers who were able to discern the eternal truths by raising their life-spirit to the plane of universal spirit. They are the pioneer researchers in the realm of the spirit who saw more in the world than their followers. Their utterances are not based on transitory vision but on a continuous experience of resident life and power. When the Vedas are regarded as the highest authority, all that is meant is that the most exacting of all authorities is the authority of facts" (IVL 89-90).

If the ancient seers are, as Radhakrishnan suggests, "pioneer researchers," the Upaniṣads are the records of their experiments. "The chief sacred scriptures of the Hindus, the Vedas register the intuitions of the perfected souls. They are not so much dogmatic dicta as transcripts from life. They record the spiritual experiences of souls strongly endowed with the sense of reality. They are held to be authoritative on the ground that they express the experiences of the experts in the field of religion" (HVL 17).

Radhakrishnan's understanding of scripture as the scientific records of spiritual insights holds not only for Hinduism, but for all religious creeds. Correctly understood, the various scriptures found in the religions of the world are not an infallible revelation, but scientific hypotheses: "The creeds of religion correspond to theories of science" (IVL 86). Radhakrishnan thus recommends that "intuitions of the human soul... should be studied by the methods which are adopted with such great success in the region of positive science" (IVL 85). The records of religious experience, of integral intuitions, that are the world's scriptures constitute the "facts" of the religious endeavor. So, "just as there can be no geometry without the perception of space, even so there cannot be philosophy of religion without the facts of religion" (IVL 84).

Religious claims, in Radhakrishnan's mind, are there for the testing. They ought not be taken as authoritative in and of themselves, for only integral intuitions validated by the light of reason are the final authority on religious matters. "It is for philosophy of religion to find out whether the convictions of the religious seers fit in with the tested laws and principles of the universe" (IVL 85). "When the prophets reveal in symbols the truths they have discovered, we try to rediscover them for ourselves slowly and patiently" (IVL 202).

The scientific temperament demanded by "Hinduism" lends itself to Radhakrishnan's affirmation of the advaitic Absolute. The plurality of religious claims ought to be taken as "tentative and provisional, not because there is no absolute, but because there is one. The intellectual accounts become barriers to further insights if they get hardened into articles of faith and forget that they are constructed theories of experience" (IVL 199).

For Radhakrishnan, the marginalization of intuition and the abandonment of the experimental attitude in matters of religion has lead Christianity to dogmatic stasis. "It is an unfortunate legacy of the course which Christian theology has followed in Europe that faith has come to connote a mechanical adherence to authority. If we take faith in the proper sense of truth or spiritual conviction, religion is faith or intuition" (HVL 16). The religious cul de sac in which Europe and Christian theology find themselves testifies to their reluctance to embrace the Hindu maxim that "theory, speculations, [and] dogma change from time to time as the facts become better understood" (IVL 90). For the value of religious "facts" can only be assessed "from their adequacy to experience" (IVL 90). Just as the intellect has dominated Western philosophy to the detriment of intuition, so too has Christianity followed suit in its search for a theological touchstone in scripture.

e. Practical Mysticism and Applied Ethics

Radhakrishnan's appeal to intuition underlies his vision for an ethical Hinduism, a Hinduism free from ascetic excesses. The ethical potency of intuition affirms the validity of the world. "Asceticism," Radhakrishnan emphasizes, "is an excess indulged in by those who exaggerate the transcendent aspect of reality." Instead, the rational mystic "does not recognize any antithesis between the secular and the sacred. Nothing is to be rejected; everything is to be raised" (IVL 115).

Radhakrishnan's ethical mystic does not simply see the inherent value of the world and engage in its affairs. Rather, the ethical individual is guided by an intuitive initiative to move the world forward creatively, challenging convention and established patterns of social interaction. For Radhakrishnan, this ethically integrated mode of being presents a positive challenge to moral dogmatism. The positive challenge to moral convention, according to Radhakrishnan, is the creative promotion of social tolerance and accommodation. Just as Radhakrishnan's Hinduism rejects absolute claims to truth and the validity of external authority, so too has Hinduism "developed an attitude of comprehensive charity instead of a fanatic faith in an inflexible creed" (HVL 37).

i. Ethics of Caste

Radhakrishnan affirms that the caste system, correctly understood, is an exemplary case of ethical tolerance and accommodation born out of an intuitive consciousness of reality. "The institution of caste illustrates the spirit of comprehensive synthesis characteristic of the Hindu mind with its faith in the collaboration of races and the co-operation of cultures. Paradoxical as it may seem, the system of caste is the outcome of tolerance and trust" (HVL 93) Based not on the mechanical fatalism of karma, as suggested by Hinduism's critics, but on a recognition of Hinduism's spiritual values and ethical ideals, caste affirms the value of each individual to work out his or her own spiritual realization, a spiritual consciousness Radhakrishnan understands in terms of integral experience. Just as Radhakrishnan sees his ranking of religions as affirming the relative value of each religion in terms of its proximity to Vedanta, the institution of caste is a social recognition that each member of society has the opportunity to experiment with his or her own spiritual consciousness free from dogmatic restraints. In Radhakrishnan's eyes, herein lies the ethical potency and creative genius of integral experience. Caste is the creative innovation of those "whose lives are characterized by an unshakable faith in the supremacy of the spirit, invincible optimism, ethical universalism, and religious toleration" (IVL 126). [For a discussion of the democratic basis of caste in Radhakrishnan's thinking, see Robert Minor, Radhakrishnan: A Religious Biography(1989).]

3. Criticism

There are numerous criticisms that may be raised against Radhakrishnan's philosophy. What follows is not an exhaustive list, but three of the most common criticisms which may be levied against Radhakrishnan.

a. Epistemic Authority

The first is a criticism regarding the locus of epistemic authority. One might ask the question: Does the test for knowledge lie in scripture or in experience? Radhakrishnan's view is that knowledge comes from intuitive experience (anubhava). Radhakrishnan makes this claim on the basis of scripture, namely the Upaniṣads. The Upaniṣads, according to Radhakrishnan, support a monistic ontology. Radhakrishnan makes this claim on the basis that the Upaniṣads are the records of the personal experiences of the ancient sages. Thus, the validity of one's experience is determined by its proximity to that which is recorded in the Upaniṣads. Conversely, the Upaniṣads are authoritative because they are the records of monistic experiences. There is a circularity here. But this circularity is one with which Radhakrishnan himself would likely not only acknowledge, but embrace. After all, Radhakrishnan might argue, intuitive knowledge is non-rational. An intuitive experience of Reality is not contrary to reason but beyond the constraints of logical analysis.

b. Cultural and Religious Constructions

A second criticism of Radhakrishnan's views surrounds his characterizations of the "East" and the "West." Radhakrishnan characterizes the West, as well as Christianity, as inclined to dogmatism, the scientific method whose domain is limited to exploration of the outer natural world, and a reliance upon second-hand knowledge. The East, by contrast, is dominated by an openness to inner experience and spiritual experimentation. The West is rational and logical, while the East is predominantly religious and mystical. As pointed out by numerous scholars working in the areas of post-colonial studies and orientalism, Radhakrishnan's constructions of "West" and "East" (these categories themselves being constructions) accept and perpetuate orientalist and colonialist forms of knowledge constructed during the 18th and 19th centuries. Arguably, these characterizations are "imagined" in the sense that they reflect the philosophical and religious realities of neither "East" nor "West."

c. Selectivity of Evidence

A separate but related criticism that might be levied against Radhakrishnan's views has to do with his theory of religious pluralism and his treatment of the religious traditions with which he deals.

First, Radhakrishnan minimizes the contributions of the monistic philosophers and religious mystics of the West. While Radhakrishnan acknowledges the work of such thinkers as Henri Bergon, Goethe, and a variety of Christian, Jewish, and Muslim mystics, he seems to imply that such approaches to religious and philosophical life in the West are exceptions rather than the rule. In fact, Radhakrishnan goes so far as to suggest that such figures are imbued with the spirit of the East, and specifically Hinduism as he understands it.

Second, while Radhakrishnan readily acknowledges the religious diversity within "Hinduism," his treatment of Western traditions is much less nuanced. In a sense, Radhakrishnan homogenizes and generalizes Western traditions. In his hierarchy of religions (see Section 2c above), one or another form of Hinduism may be located within each of his religious categories (monistic, theistic, incarnational, ancestoral, and natural). By contrast, Radhakrishnan seems to imply that the theistic (second) and the incarnational (third) categories are the domains of Unitarian and Trinitarian Christianity respectively.

4. List of Abbreviations

HVL - The Hindu View of Life (1927)

IP1 - Indian Philosophy: Volume 1 (1923)

IVL - An Idealist View of Life (1929)

MST - My Search for Truth (1937)

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources by Radhakrishnan

  • The Ethics of the Vedanta and Its Metaphysical Presuppositions. Madras: The Guardian Press, 1908.
  • "Karma and Freewill" in Modern Review. (Calcutta) Vol. III (May 1908), pp. 424-428.
  • "Indian Philosophy: The Vedas and the Six Systems" in The Madras Christian College Magazine. III (New Series), pp. 22-35.
  • "'Nature' and ‘Convention' in Greek Ethics" in The Calcutta Review, CXXX (January 1910), pp. 9-23.
  • "Egoism and Altruism: The Vedanta Solution" in East and West (Bombay) IX (July 1910), pp. 626-630.
  • "The Relation of Morality to Religion" in The Hindustan Review (September 1910), pp. 292-297.
  • "Morality and Religion in Education" in The Madras Christian College Magazine. X (1910-1911), pp. 233-239.
  • "The Ethics of the Bhagavadgita and Kant" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXI, Number 4 (July 1911), pp. 465-475.
  • Essentials of Psychology. London: Oxford University Press, 1912.
  • "The Ethics of the Vedanta" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXIV, Number 2 (January 1914), pp. 168-183.
  • "The Vedanta Philosophy and the Doctrine of Maya" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXIV, Number 4 (April 1914), pp. 431-451.
  • "A View of India on the War" in Asiatic Review. (London), VI (May 1915), pp. 369-374.
  • Religion and Life, Leaflet No. 15, The Theistic Endeavor Society of Madras. November 1915.
  • "The Vedantic Approach to Reality" in The Monist. XXVI, Number 2 (April 1916), pp. 200-231.
  • "Religion and Life" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXVII, Number 1 (October 1916), pp. 91-106.
  • "Bergson's Idea of God" in The Quest. (London), VII (October 1916), pp. 1-8.
  • "The Philosophy of Rabindranath Tagore – I" in The Quest. (London) VIII, Number 3 (April 1917), pp. 457-477.
  • "The Philosophy of Rabindranath Tagore – II" in The Quest. (London) VIII, Number 4 (July 1917), pp. 592-612.
  • "Vedantamum Mayavadamum in Cittantam" in Siddhantam: Journal of the Saiva Siddhanta Association. V, pp. 159-163.
  • The Philosophy of Rabindranath Tagore. London: Macmillan & Co., 1918.
  • "James Ward's Pluaralistic Theism: I" in The Indian Philosophical Review. II, Number 2 (October 1918), pp. 97-118.
  • "James Ward's Pluaralistic Theism: II" in The Indian Philosophical Review. II, Number 3 (December 1918), pp. 210-232.
  • "Bergson and Absolute Idealism – I" in Mind. (New Series) XXVII (January 1919), pp. 41-53.
  • "Bergson and Absolute Idealism – II" in Mind. (New Series) XXVII (July 1919), pp. 275-296.
  • The Reign of Religion in Contemporary Philosophy. London: Macmillan & Co., 1920.
  • "The Future of Religion" in The Mysore University Magazine. IV, (1920), pp. 148-157.
  • "Review of Bernard Bosanquet's ‘Implication and Linear Inference'" in The Indian Philosophical Review. III, Number 3 (July 1920), p. 301.
  • "The Metaphysics of the Upanisads – I" in The Indian Philosophical Review. III, Number 3, (July 1920), pp. 213-236.
  • The Metaphysics of the Upanisads – II in The Indian Philosophical Review. III, Number 4, (October 1920), pp. 346-362.
  • "Gandhi and Tagore" in The Calcutta Review. (Third Series), I (October 1921), pp. 14-29.
  • "Religion and Philosophy" in The Hibbert Journal. XX, Number 1 (October 1921), pp. 35-45.
  • "Tilak as Scholar" in The Indian Review. XXII (December 1921), pp. 737-739.
  • "Contemporary Philosophy" in The Indian Review. XXIII (July 1922), pp. 440-443.
  • "The Heart of Hinduism" in The Hibbert Journal. XXI, Number 1 (October 1922), pp. 5-19.
  • "The Hindu Dharma" in The International Journal of Ethics. XXXIII, Number 1 (October 1922), pp. 1-22.
  • Indian Philosophy: Volume 1. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1923.
  • "Islam and Indian Thought" in The Indian Review. XXIV (Novermber 1923), pp. 53-72.
  • "Religious Unity" in The Mysore University Magazine. VII, pp. 187-198.
  • The Philosophy of the Upanisads. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1924.
  • "Hindu Thought and Christian Doctrine" in The Madras Christian College Magazine. (Quarterly Series) (January 1924), pp. 18-34.
  • "The Hindu Idea of God" in The Quest. (London) XV, Number 3 (April 1924), pp. 289-310.
  • "Indian Philosophy: Some Problems" in Mind. (New Series) XXV (April 1926), pp. 154-180.
  • The Hindu View of Life. London: George Allen & Unwim, Ltd., 1927.
  • "The Role of Philosophy in the History of Civilization" in Edgar Shefield Brightman (ed.)Proceedings of the Sixth International Congress of Philosophy. New York: Longmans, Green and Co., 1927. pp. 543-550.
  • "The Doctrine of Maya: Some Problems" in Edgar Shefield Brightman (ed.) Proceedings of the Sixth International Congress of Philosophy. New York: Longmans, Green and Co., 1927. pp. 683-689.
  • Indian Philosophy: Volume 2. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1927.
  • "Presidential Address" in Proceedings of the III Indian Philosophical Congress. Calcutta: Calcutta University, 1927. pp. 19-30.
  • "Educational Reform" in The Calcutta Review. (May 1927), pp. 143-154.
  • The Religion We Need. London: Ernest Benn, Ltd., 1928.
  • The Vedanta According to Śaṅkara and Ramanuja. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1928.
  • "Indian Philosophy (To the Editor of Mind)" in Mind. (New Series) XXXVII (January 1928), pp. 130-131.
  • Buddhism in Prabuddha Bharata. XXXIII, Number 8 (August 1928), pp. 349-354.
  • "Evolution and Its Implications" in The New Era. I (November 1928), pp. 102-111.
  • Kalki or The Future of Civilization. London: Kegan, Paul, Trench & Co. Ltd., 1929.
  • An Idealist View of Life. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1929.
  • "Indian Philosophy" in Encyclopedia Britannica. (14th edition) Volume XII, New York, pp. 242-243.
  • Prof. Radhakrishnan's Reply in The Modern Review. XLV, Number 2 (February 1929), pp. 208-213.
  • Prof. Radhakrishnan's Reply in The Modern Review. XLV, Number 3 (March 1929), pp. 321-322.
  • "Review of John Baillie's ‘The Interpretation of Religion'" in The Hibbert Journal. XXVIII, Number 4 (July 1930), 740-742.
  • ""Foreword"" in Abhay Kumer Majumdar, The Sāṃkhya Conception of Personality. Calcutta: Calcutta University Press, 1930. pp. ix-xii.
  • "The Hindu Idea of God" in The Spectator. May 30, 1931 (Number 51370), pp. 851-853.
  • "Intuition and Intellect" in Ramananda Chatterjee (ed.) The Golden Book of Tagore: A Hommage to Rabindranath Tagore from India and the World in Celebration of His Seventieth Birthday. Calcutta: Golden Book Committee, pp. 310-313.
  • ""Foreword"" in Nalini Kanta Brahma, The Philosophy of Hindu Sadhana. London: Kegan, Paul, Trench & Co., pp. ix-x.
  • "Presidential Address" in H.D. Bhattacharyya (ed.) Proceedings of the Eighth Indian Philosophical Congress: The University of Mysore. Calcutta: N.C. Ghosh, pp. v-xvi.
  • "Sarvamukti (Universal Salvation) - A Symposium" in H.D. Bhattacharyya (ed.)Proceedings of the Eighth Indian Philosophical Congress: The University of Mysore. Calcutta: N.C. Ghosh, pp. 314-318.
  • East and West in Religion. London: George Allen & Unwin, Ltd., 1933.
  • "Intellect and Intuition in Sankara's Philosophy" in Triveni. VI, Number 1 (July-August 1933), pp. 8-16.
  • The Teaching of the Buddha: Being the Inaugural Lecture under the Alphina Ratnayaka Trust Delivered by Sir Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan at Columbo, 2nd October, 1933. Columbo: The Public Trust of Ceylon, 1933.
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  • "The Failure of the Intellectuals" in The Indian Review. XXXVIII (December 1937), pp. 737-739.
  • ""Foreword"" in Saroj Kumar Das A Study of the Vedanta. Calcutta: Calcutta University, 1937. pp. ix-x.
  • Gautama the Buddha. London: Oxford University Press, 1938.
  • "Religion: A Plea for Sanity" in Triveni. (New Series) XI, Number 5 (November 1938), pp. 9-14.
  • "The Renascence of Religion: A Hindu View" in The Renascence of Religion: Being the Proceedings of the Third Meetings of the World Congress of Faiths. London: Arthur Probstain, 1938. pp. 8-18.
  • "Convocation Address" (December 17, 1938) reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. pp. 9-19.
  • "Letter to Madan Mohan Malaviya" dated 3/12/39 reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1994. p. 5.
  • "Letter to Madan Mohan Malaviya" dated 20/8/39 reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. p. 8.
  • "Letter to Madan Mohan Malaviya" dated 26/11 reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. pp. 20-21.
  • ""Foreword"" in T.M.P. Mahadevan The Philosophy of Advaita. Madras: Ganesh and Co., 1938.
  • Eastern Religions and Western Thought. London: Oxford University Press, 1939.
  • "Introduction: Gandhi's Religion and Politics" in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (ed.) Mahatma Gandhi: Essays and Reflections on His Life and Work. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1939. pp. 13-40.
  • "Foreword" in S.K. George Gandhi's Challenge to Christianity. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1939. pp. 9-10.
  • "Presidential Address" in Proceedings of the 15th Conference, All India Federation of Educational Associations, Lucknow, December 26-31, 1939. Allahabad: Ram Narain Lal, 1939. pp. 100-105.
  • "Hinduism and the West ‘in L.S.S. O'Malley (ed.) Modern India and the West. London: Oxford University Press, 1941. pp. 338-353.
  • "Supreme Values of the Spirit" (Speech on the laying of the foundation-stone to Holdar House, Banaras Hindu University) reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1994. pp. 10-14.
  • "Coming Out of Darkness" (Speech delivered on the Silver Jubilee of Benaras Hindu University, January 21, 1942) excerpts reprinted in Benaras Hindu University News Letter. (Teacher's Day Special Number) 5th September 1993. pp. 6-7.
  • "General Preface" in Ganganatha Jha Pūrva-Mīmāṃsā in its Sources. Benaras: Benaras Hindu University, 1942. pp. v-vi.
  • "The Cultural Problem" in A.I.J. Appasamy (ed.) The Cultural Problem (Oxford Pamphlets on Indian Affairs) Number 1. Madras: Oxford University Press, 1942. pp. 41-50.
  • "India's Heritage" in The Proceedings and Transactions of the XII Session of the All India Oriental Conference. Benaras: Benaras University Press, 1943. pp. 1-5.
  • "Silver Jubilee Address" in Annals of the Bhandarkar Oriental Research Institute. XXIV, Parts 1-2 (Monday January 4, 1943), 1943. pp. 1-8.
  • Education, Politics and War. Poona: The International Book Service, 1944.
  • India and China: Lectures Delivered in China in May 1944. Bombay: Hind Kitabs, Ltd., 1944.
  • "Foreword" in Swami Nirvedananda Hinduism at a Glance. Calcutta: Vidyamandira, 1944.
  • "Foreword" in D.S. Sharma Studies in the Renaissance of Hinduism in the Nineteenth and Twentieth Century. Banaras: Banaras Hindu University, 1944. pp. v-vi.
  • Is this Peace? Bombay: Hind Kitabs, Ltd., 1945.
  • Moral Values in Literature in K.R. Srinivasa Iyengar (ed.) Indian Writers in Council: Proceedings of the First All-India Writers Conference (Jaipur 1945). Bombay: International Book House Ltd., 1945. pp. 86-105.
  • "Introduction" in Dilip Kumar Roy Among the Great. Bombay: Nalanda Publication, 1945. pp. 11-18.
  • "Foreword" in Swami Avinasananda Gita Letters. Bombay: Hind Kitabs Ltd., 1945.
  • "Foreword" in R.K. Prabhu and U.R. Rao (eds.) The Mind of Mahatma Gandhi. Bombay: Oxford University Press, 1945. pp. v-vi.
  • "Speech" in P.E.N. News. Number 142 (March 1946), pp. 8-10.
  • "The Voice of India in the Spiritual Crisis of Our Times" in The Hibbert Journal. XLV, Number 4 (July 1946), pp. 295-304.
  • "Bhagavan Sri Ramana: Sustainer of Spiritual Reality" in Golden Jubilee Souvenir. Tiruvannamalai: Sri Ramanasram, 1946. pp. 51-56.
  • "Speech" in General Discussion of the Work of the Prepatory Commission in UNESCO General Conference: First Session. Held at UNESCO House, Paris from 20 November to 10 December, 1946. Paris: UNESCO, 1947. pp. 27-28.
  • Religion and Society. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1947.
  • "Science and Religion" in K. Bharatha Iyer (ed.) Art and Thought: A Volume In Honour of the Late Dr. Ananda K. Coomaraswamy. London: Luzac & Co., 1947. pp. 180-185.
  • "Speech" in Discussion of the Director-General's Report in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Second Session, Mexico, 1947. Paris: UNESCO, 1948. pp. 58-61.
  • The Bhagavadgita with an Introductory Essay, Sanskrit Text, English Translation and Notes. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1948.
  • "Mahatma Gandhi" in The Hibbert Journal. XLVI, Number 3 (April 1948), pp. 193-197.
  • "General Statement" in Clara Urquhart (ed.) Last Chance: 11 Questions on Issues Determining Our Destiny Answered by 26 Leaders of Thought in 14 Nations. Boston: Beacon Press, 1948. pp. 46-54.
  • "Hinduism" in Hutchinson's Twentieth Century Encyclopedia. London: Hutchinson, 1948. pp. 522.
  • Great Indians. Bombay: Hind Kitabs Ltd., 1949.
  • Report of the University Education Commission (December 1948-August 1949). New Delhi: Ministry of Education, 1949.
  • Indian Culture in Reflections on Our Age: Lectures Delivered at the Opening Session of UNESCO at Sorbonne University, Paris. New York: Columbia University Press, 1949. pp. 115-133.
  • "Speech" in Discussion of the Director-General's Report in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Third Session, Beruit, 1948. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 56-59.
  • "Speech" in Presentation by the Chairman of the Executive Board of the Director-General's Report on the Activities of the Organization during 1949 in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fourth Session, Paris, 1949. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 44-45.
  • "Speech" in Discussion of the Director-General's Report in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fourth Session, Paris, 1949. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 58-60.
  • "Speech" in Consideration of the Report of the Official and External Relations Commission on UNESCO's Work in Germany in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fourth Session, Paris, 1949. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 194-195.
  • "Goethe" in Goethe: UNESCO's Hommage on the Occassion of the Two Hundredth Anniversary of His Birth. Paris: UNESCO, 1949. pp. 101-108.
  • Clean Advocate of Great Ideals in Nehru Abhinandan Granth: A Birthday Book. New Delhi: Nehru Abhinandan Committee, 1949. pp. 93-96.
  • The Dhammapada. London: Oxford University Press, 1950.
  • "Speech" in Discussion of the Second Report of the Credentials Committee in Records of the General Conference of the UNESCO. Fifth Session, Florence, 1950. Paris: UNESCO, 1950. pp. 178-180.
  • UNESCO and World Revolution in New Republic. July 10, 1950. pp. 15-16.
  • "Foreword" in R.R. Diwarkar The Upaniṣads in Story and Dialogue. Bombay: Hind Kitabs Ltd., 1950. pp. v-vi.
  • "Religion and World Unity" in The Hibbert Journal. XLIX (April 1951), pp. 218-225.
  • The Nature of Man in Barbara Waylen (ed.) Creators of the Modern Spirit: Towards a Philosophy of Faith. New York: Macmillan Co., 1951. pp. 64-66.
  • "The Religion of the Spirit and the World's Need: Fragments of a Confession" in Paul A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. New York: Tudor Publishing Co., 1952. pp. 5-82.
  • "Reply to Critics" in Paul A. Schilpp (ed.) The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. New York: Tudor Publishing Co., 1952. pp. 789-842.
  • "Vedanta - The Advaita School" in S. Radhakrishnan (ed.) History of Philosophy Eastern and Western: Volume 1. New York: Barnes and Noble, 1952. pp. 272-286.
  • "Inaugural Address in Report of the Proceedings, 1952." International Congress on Planned Parenthood. London: Family Planning, 1952. pp. 10-13.
  • "Religion and the World Crisis" in Christopher Isherwood (ed.) Vedanta for Modern Man. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1952. pp. 338-341.
  • "Foreword" in D.F.A. Bode and P. Nanavutty Songs of Zarathustra: The Gathas. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1952. p. 9.
  • "Concluding Survey" in S. Radhakrishnan (ed.) History of Philosophy Eastern and Western: Volume 2. New York: Barnes and Noble, 1953. pp. 439-448.
  • The Principal Upaniṣads. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1953.
  • Convocation Address on the occasion on the Silver Jubilee of the Andhra University, Waltair, 1953. Copy available at Andhra University Library Special Collections Section.
  • Comment in Visitor's Book: Voorhees College, Vellore. Dated: 17.1.53. Voohees College Archives, Vellore, Tamil Nadu.
  • "Preface" in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan, A.C. Ewing, Paul Arthur Schilpp, et al. (eds.) A.R. Wadia: Essays in Philosophy Presented in His Honour. (nd/np), 1954.
  • Recovery of Faith. New York: Harper and Brothers, 1955.
  • Bhoodan - The Economic Agrarian Revolution (Speech delivered at the Sixth Sarvodaya Sammelan at Bodh-Gaya on 19/4/1954) reprinted in Bhoodan (nd/np), 1955. pp. 1-5. Available in the Tamil Nadu State Archives, Chennai, general reference.
  • Occasional Speeches and Writings: October 1952-January 1956. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1956, 1960.
  • East and West: Some Reflections. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1956.
  • Occasional Speeches and Writings (Second Series): February 1956-February 1957. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1957.
  • A Sourcebook in Indian Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1957. (ed. with Charles A. Moore)
  • The Brahma Sutra: The Philosophy of Spiritual Life. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1959.
  • "Prefatory Remarks" in S. Radhakrishnan and P.T. Raju (eds.) The Concept of Man. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1960. pp. 9-13.
  • Note on Vice-Presidential Letterhead (No. 26/1303) to the Principal of Voorhees College located in Visitor's Book: Voorhees College, Vellore. Dated: 23rd June, 1960. Voorhees College Archives, Vellore, Tamil Nadu.
  • "Foreword" in Ramakrishnan Bajaj The Young Russia. Bombay: Popular Book Depot, 1960.
  • Fellowship of the Spirit. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1961.
  • Two Addresses Delivered in Germany: October 1961. New Delhi: Max Muller Bhavan, 1961.
  • "Most Dear to All the Muses" in A Centenary Volume: Rabindranath Tagore: 1861-1961. New Delhi: Sahitya Akademi, 1961. pp. xvii-xxv.
  • "Tagore the Philosopher" in Indo-Asian Culture. XI (January 1962), pp. 283-295.
  • "Tagore and the Realization of God" in Indo Asia. IVV (April 1962), pp. 150-157.
  • Occasional Speeches and Writings (Third Series): July 1959-May 1962. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1963.
  • "Swami Vivekananda - A Spokesman of the Divine Logos" in Vedanta Kesari. L, Number 4 (August 1963), pp. 158-163.
  • President Radhakrishnan's Speeches and Writings: May 1962-May1964. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1965.
  • On Nehru. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1965.
  • President Radhakrishnan's Speeches and Writings (Second Series): May 1964-May1967. New Delhi: Ministry of Information and Broadcasting, Government of India, 1967.
  • Religion in a Changing World. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd., 1967.
  • "The Indian Approach to the Religious Problem" in Charles A. Moore (ed.) The Indian Mind. Honolulu: East-West Center Press, 1967. pp. 173-182.
  • Religion and Culture. Delhi: Hind Pocket Books, 1968.
  • "Introduction" in Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan (ed.) Mahatma Gandhi: 100 Years. New Delhi: Gandhi Peace Foundation, 1968. pp. 1-10.
  • Our Heritage. Delhi: Hind Pocket Books, 1973.
  • The Creative Life. New Delhi: Orient Paperbacks, 1975.
  • "Are We Planning for Life?" in Mira. XXXIII, Numbers 8-9 (July-August 1975), pp. 179-180 and 206.

b. Selected Secondary Sources

  • Arapura, J.G. Radhakrishnan and Integral Experience: The Philosophy and World Vision of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. Calcutta: Asia Publishing House, 1966.
  • Atreya, J.P. (ed.) Dr. S. Radhakrishnan: Sovenir Volume. Moradabad: Darshana International, 1964.
  • Baird, Robert D. (ed.) Religion in Modern India. New Delhi: Manohar, 1981.
  • Banerji, Anjan Kumar (ed.) Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan: A Centenary Tribute. Varanasi, 1991-1992.
  • Bishop, Donald H. (ed.) Thinkers of the Indian Renaissance. New Delhi: Wiley Eastern Limited, 1982.
  • Braue, Donald A. Maya in Radhakrishnan's Thought: Six Meanings Other than Illusion. Columbia: South Asia Books, 1985.
  • Brookman, David M. Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan in the Commentarial Tradition of India. Bhubaneswara, 1990.
  • Gopal, Sarvepalli. Radhakrishnan: A Biography. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Harris, Ishwar C. Radhakrishnan: The Profile of a Universalist. Columbia: South Asia Books, 1982.
  • Hawley, Michael. A Biography of Experience: Radhakrishnan, Apologetics and Orientalism. (Unpublished Ph.D. Dissertation) University of Calgary, 2002.
  • Hawley, Michael. "The Making of a Mahatma: Radhakrishnan's Critique of Gandhi" inStudies in Religion. 32/1-2 (2003) 135-148.
  • Hawley, Michael. "Reorienting Tradition: Radhakrishnan's Hinduism" in Steven Engler and Greg P. Grieve (eds.) Historicizing' Tradition' in the Study of Religion. Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter, 2005.
  • Kalapati, Joshua. Dr. S. Radhakrishnan and Christianity. (Unpublished Ph.D. dissertation) Madras Christian College, Tambaram, March 1994.
  • Kalidas, Vuppuluri (ed.) The Radhakrishnan Number: A Souvenir Volume of Appreciations. Madras: Vyasa Publications, 1962.
  • Kulangara, Thomas. Absolutism and Theism: A Philosophical Study of S. Radhakrishnan's Attempt to Reconcile Sankara's Absolutism and Ramanuja's Theism. Trivandrum, 1989.
  • McDermott, Robert A. Radhakrishnan: Selected Writings on Philosophy, Religion and Culture. New York: E.P. Dutton & Co., 1970.
  • Minor, Robert N. Modern Indian Interpreters of the Bhagavadgita. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1986.
  • Minor, Robert N. Radhakrishnan: A Religious Biography. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987.
  • Murthy, K. Satchidananda Radhakrishnan: His Life and Ideas. Delhi, 1989.
  • Nanadakumar, Prema S. Radhakrishnan: Makers of Indian Literature. New Delhi, 1992.
  • Naravane, V.S. Modern Indian Thought. Columbia: South Asia Books, 1978.
  • Pappu, S.S. Rama Rao (ed.) New Essays in The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications, 1995.
  • Parthasarathi G. and D.P. Chattapadhyaya (eds.) Radhakrishnan: Centenary Volume. Delhi: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur (ed.) The Philosophy of Sarvepalli Radhakrishnan. New York: Tudor Publishing, 1952.

Author Informaiton

Michael Hawley
Mount Royal College

Edward Caird (1835—1908)

cairdA Scottish philosopher of the latter half of the nineteenth century, Edward Caird was one of the key figures of the idealist movement that dominated British philosophy from 1870 until the mid 1920s. Best known for his studies of Kant and Hegel, he argued that "Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism." Caird exercised a strong influence on the second generation of idealists, such as John Watson and Bernard Bosanquet. During his long and productive life, Caird was active in university and local politics and in educational and social reform. In his two series of Gifford lectures, he developed an important evolutionary account of religious conceptions ( the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity).

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Critique of Kant and Hegel
  3. Philosophical Style
  4. Evolution and Religion
  5. Reference and Further Reading

1. Biography

Edward Caird was born in Greenock, Scotland, on March 23, 1835. A younger brother of the theologian John Caird (1820-1898), Edward began his studies at the University of Glasgow (which he briefly abandoned due to ill health), later moving to Balliol College, Oxford, from which he graduated in 1863. Following his graduation, he became Tutor at Merton College, Oxford (1864-1866), but soon left for the Professorship of Moral Philosophy at Glasgow (1866-1893). There, in addition to carrying out his academic duties, Caird was active in university and local politics, and was responsible for establishing the study of political sciences at the University. Following the death of Benjamin Jowett (1817-1893), Caird returned to Oxford, where he served as Master of Balliol College until 1907. He was a founding fellow of the British Academy (1902), a corresponding member of the French Academy, and held honorary doctorates from the Universities of St Andrews (1883), Oxford (1891), Cambridge (1898) and Wales (1902).

Like many of the British idealists, Caird had a strong interest in classical literature. In his two volumes of Essays on Literature and Philosophy (1892), he brought together critical essays on Goethe, Rousseau, Carlyle, Dante and Wordsworth, with a discussion (in Volume II) of Cartesianism (Descartes, Malbranche and Spinoza) and metaphysics.

Caird's politics were generally liberal and progressive. He supported the education of women, opposed the Anglo-Boer War (1899-1902) and, like Green, was involved in the 'university settlement' programs--particularly in Glasgow and in London--where recent university graduates and professionals attempted to narrow the gap between social classes by living and working among and with the poor.

In 1907, Caird resigned his position as Master of Balliol, and died the following year on November 1. He is buried in St Sepulchre's Cemetery, Oxford, alongside Jowett and Green.

2. Critique of Kant and Hegel

Along with T.H. Green (1836-1882), Caird was one of the first generation of British idealists, whose philosophical work was largely in reaction to the then-dominant empiricist and associationist views of Alexander Bain (1818-1903) and J.S. Mill. He had, however, an ability of literary expression which Green did not possess; he was also more inclined to discuss questions by the method of tracing the historical development of the ideas involved. But while Green died at the early age of 47, Caird enjoyed a relatively long and productive life. It is, in part, for this reason that he exercised such a strong influence—particularly on the relation of philosophy and religion—on later idealists such as John Watson (1847-1939) and Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923). Though often considered to be Hegelian, Caird was arguably more profoundly influenced by Kant, although he was far from an uncritical reader.

Caird's first major work was A Critical Account of the Philosophy of Kant (1877), focusing on the Critique of Pure Reason and the Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics. It was superseded in 1889 by The Critical Philosophy of Immanuel Kant (two volumes) in which Caird wished to show the relation of the three Critiques and the continuity in the movement of Kant's thought. In general, Caird was convinced that, though Kant had inaugurated a new era in philosophy with his attempt to integrate the a priori and the a posteriori, he failed to carry out this task fully. It was here that Caird's idealism took over. In these volumes on Kant, Caird sought "to display in the very argument of the great metaphysician, who was supposed to have cut the world in two with a hatchet, an almost involuntary but continuous and inevitable regression towards objective organic unity." Thus, he argued that "Kantian philosophy is only a first stage, though of course a necessary stage, in the transition of philosophy to higher forms of Idealism." (1877, p. 667)

A sympathetic exposition of Hegel's philosophy is contained in his monograph on Hegel (1883) and, in 1885, his Social Philosophy and Religion of Comte (based on a collection of articles that had been previously published in the magazine, Contemporary Review) appeared. In these two works, Caird critically interprets these authors on lines of his own. Concerning Comte, for example, Caird writes that there cannot be a 'religion of Humanity' that is not, at the same time, a religion of God. In his treatment of Hegel, as of Kant, Caird's purpose was to show that there is a center of unity to which the mind must come back out of all differences, however varied and alien in appearance. The analysis was preliminary to reconstruction.

3. Philosophical Style

Caird's way of philosophizing differed from that of many of his contemporaries. It was consistently and even obtrusively constructive. According to Caird, "the true manner of honoring a thinker is to force oneself to understand him from his own point of view," and only then "to submit his ideas to as objective an examination as possible." Thus, he seized on the truths contained in the authors with whom he dealt, and was only incidentally concerned with their errors. One of the results of this, however, was that Caird's own views are often to be found only indirectly--that is, in his exposition and commentary of the views of others.

4. Evolution and Religion

Like many other idealists, such as D.G. Ritchie (1853-1903), Caird was concerned to show the relation of evolutionary theory to the development of thought and culture. His first set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Religion (2 volumes, 1893), deals less than his other works with an exposition of the views of other philosophers. These lectures focussed on the possibility of a science of religion and the nature of religion from Greek times, but were especially centered on the development of the Christian faith through to the Reformation. Caird shows the spiritual sense of humanity as at first dominated by the object, but constrained by its own abstractions to swing around so as to fall under the sway of the subject.

In 1904 Caird's second set of Gifford lectures, The Evolution of Theology in the Greek Philosophers,appeared. Here, he provides again an evolutionary account of religious conceptions (e.g., the idea of the good, the soul, God, and the relation of God to humanity) toward a 'reflective religion'