Category Archives: Philosophers

Empedocles (c.492—432 B.C.E.)

empedoclesEmpedocles (of Acagras in Sicily) was a philosopher and poet: one of the most important of the philosophers working before Socrates (the Presocratics), and a poet of outstanding ability and of great influence upon later poets such as Lucretius. His works On Nature and Purifications (whether they are two poems or only one – see below) exist in more than 150 fragments. He has been regarded variously as a materialist physicist, a shamanic magician, a mystical theologian, a healer, a democratic politician, a living god, and a fraud. To him is attributed the invention of the four-element theory of matter (earth, air, fire, and water), one of the earliest theories of particle physics, put forward seemingly to rescue the phenomenal world from the static monism of Parmenides. Empedocles’ world-view is of a cosmic cycle of eternal change, growth and decay, in which two personified cosmic forces, Love and Strife, engage in an eternal battle for supremacy. In psychology and ethics Empedocles was a follower of Pythagoras, hence a believer in the transmigration of souls, and hence also a vegetarian. He claims to be a daimôn, a divine or potentially divine being, who, having been banished from the immortals gods for ‘three times countless years’ for committing the sin of meat-eating and forced to suffer successive reincarnations in an purificatory journey through the different orders of nature and elements of the cosmos, has now achieved the most perfect of human states and will be reborn as an immortal. He also claims seemingly magical powers including the ability to revive the dead and to control the winds and rains.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Works
  3. Physics and Cosmology
    1. Physics
    2. Cosmology
  4. Biology
    1. Origin of Species
    2. Embryology
    3. Perception and Thought
  5. Ethics and the Journey of the Soul
    1. The Daimôns and Transmigration of Souls
    2. Meat-eating and Sin
    3. Theology
    4. Physics and Theology
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and Commentaries
    2. Studies

1. Life

The most detailed source for Empedocles' life is Diogenes Laertius, Lives of the Eminent Philosophers 8.51-75. Perhaps because of his claims to divine status and magical powers a remarkable number of apocryphal stories gathered around the life of Empedocles in antiquity. His death in particular attracted attention and is reported to have occurred in several, clearly bathetic, ways: that he fell overboard from a ship and drowned; that he fell from his carriage, broke his leg and died; that he hanged himself; or the most famous account that, when he felt he was shortly to die and because he wished to appear to have been apotheosized, he leapt into the crater of Etna. In this story the ruse was unfortunately discovered when one of his trademark bronze sandals was thrown up by the volcano.

From more reliable sources it seems that he was born at Acragas in Sicily around 492 B.C.E. and died at the age of sixty. He was the son of a certain Meton, and was from an important and wealthy local aristocratic family: his grandfather, also called Empedocles, is reported to have been victorious in horse-racing at the Olympic Games in 496 B.C.E. It is not known where or with whom he studied philosophy, but various teachers are assigned to him by ancient sources, among them Parmenides, Pythagoras, Xenophanes, Anaxagoras and Anaximander (from whom he is said to have inherited his extravagant mode of dress). Whether or not he was his pupil, Empedocles was certainly very familiar with the work of Parmenides from whom he took the inspiration to write in hexameter verse, and whose physical system he adopts in part, and partly seeks to rectify.

He is reported to have been wealthy and to have kept a train of boy attendants and also to have provided dowries for many girls of Acragas. In dress he affected a purple robe with a golden girdle, bronze sandals, and a Delphic laurel-wreath, and in his manner he was grave and cultivated a regal public persona. These attributes contrast with his political outlook which is uniformly reported to have been actively pro-democratic. He began his political career with the prosecution of two state officials for their arrogant behaviour towards foreign guests which was seen as a sign of incipient tyrannical tendencies. He is also credited with activities against other anti-democratic citizens, and even with putting down an oligarchy and instituting a democracy at Acragas by use of his powers of rhetorical persuasion. Two speeches of his in favour of equality are also mentioned. His surviving poetry certainly shows considerable rhetorical skills, and indeed he is credited by Aristotle with the invention of rhetoric itself. Another report is of his breaking up a shadowy aristocratic political organisation called the 'Thousand'. As a whole the tradition presents a picture of Empedocles as a popular politician, rhetorician, and champion of democracy and equality. This appears to fit in with the known history of Acragas where after the death of the popular and enlightened tyrant Theron in 473 B.C.E. his son Thrasydaeus proved to be a violent despot. After his forcible removal a democracy was established despite continuing political tensions.

As well as a being a philosopher, poet and politician, Empedocles was famous for his medical skills and healing powers. In his works he presents himself as a wandering healer offering to thousands of eager followers 'prophecies' and ‘words of healing for all kinds of illnesses' (fr. 112 (Fragment numbers are those of Diels-Kranz)). He also promises his addressee Pausanias 'you will learn remedies (pharmaka) for ills and help against old age' and even ‘you will lead from Hades the life-force of a dead man'. To what degree this represents the real Empedocles is not known, but a tradition grew up of him as both a renowned physician and a practitioner of more magical cures, or as a charlatan. These stories however, may well derive from Empedocles' own words in his poetry. On the other hand his work does show considerable interest in biology and especially in embryology and he was eminent enough as a writer on medicine to be attack ed by the writer of the Hippocratic treatise On Ancient Medicine who attempts to separate medicine from philosophy and rejects Empedocles' work along with all philosophical medical works as irrelevant. The stories of his wonder-working such as curing entire plagues, reviving the dead and controlling the elements are clearly exaggerated at least, but it is becoming clearer, especially since the discovery of the Strasbourg fragments (see below), that, contrary to many former interpretations, Empedocles did not make a clear separation between his philosophy of nature and the more mystical, theological aspects of his philosophy, and so may well have seen no great difference in kind between healing ills through empirical understanding of human physiognomy and healing by means of sacred incantations and ritual purifications. His public as well may have made no great distinction between 'scientific' and sacred medicine as is suggested by the account of Empedocles curing a plague by restoring a fresh water-supply, after which he was venerated as a god.

2. Works

Empedocles work survives only in fragments, but luckily in a far greater number than any of the other Presocratics. These fragments are mostly quotations found in other authors such as Aristotle and Plutarch. Although many works, including tragedies and a medical treatise, are attributed to Empedocles by ancient sources no fragments of these have survived, and the extant fragments all come from a work of hexameter poetry traditionally entitled On Nature (Peri Phuseôs) or Physics (Phusika) and some from a possibly separate work called Purifications (Katharmoi). Of these two titles On Nature is by far the better attested and nearly all the fragments which are cited by ancient authors along with the title of the work they came from are attributed to On Nature, while only two are attributed to the Purifications. Because the fragments contain both material that clearly refers to physics and cosmology - the four elements, the cosmic cycle etc. – and also material concerning the fate of the soul, sin and purification, traditionally the former were placed in reconstructions of On Nature, and the latter in the Purifications. Indeed Empedocles' writings contain ideas and themes that may seem quite incompatible with one another. On Natureas usually reconstructed seemed the work of a mechanist physicist which seeks to replace the traditional gods with four lifeless impersonal elements and two cosmic forces of attraction and repulsion, Love and Strife. The Purifications on the other hand seemed the work of a deeply religious Pythagorean mystic: it was often thought that Empedocles either wrote the Purifications as a move away from the mechanistic materialist position in On Nature, or that the Purifications were an addendum to On Nature, looking at the world from quite a different perspective.

However there have long been doubts about whether there were really two poems or only one poem (perhaps called On Nature and Purifications or with On Nature and Purifications as alternative titles for the same work) which contained both physical and religious material. First, although we may think of a poem called Physics as restricting itself to physical concerns alone, this may well be an anachronistic retrojection of modern rationalistic ideas of a gulf between physics and religion. Further, ancient book titles tend to be generic and there is a long tradition of works called either On Nature (Peri Phuseôs) or Physics (Physika) by various authors, with the earliest attested title for such works being On the Nature of the Universe (Peri Phuseôs tôn Ontôn 'On the Nature of Things that Exist'), and so neither title may be Empedocles' own and the two may perhaps be interchangeable different titles for the same work. Although there is still argument on this subject the Strasbourg fragments now suggest strongly that both physical and religious material was originally together in On Nature.

In 1990 the first ancient papyrus fragments of Empedocles were rediscovered at the University of Strasbourg and were published in 1999. Since these were also the first papyrus fragments of any of the Presocratics their discovery caused considerable excitement. Among other important new information they give about Empedocles' philosophy, with great good fortune fr. a, the longest of the new fragments, was found to be a continuation of the longest of the previously known fragments (fr. 17) and thus now the two together form a continuous text of 69 lines. Fr. 17 is cited by Simplicius as being from book one of On Nature, and again very fortunately Strasbourg fr. a(ii) contains a marginal note by the manuscript copyist identifying line 30 of fr. a(ii) as line 300 of book one of On Nature. Since the Strasbourg fragments seem to have come from a single piece of papyrus, and they also overlap with a formerly known religious fragment usually placed in the Purifications (fr. 1 39) it now seems very likely that Empedocles introduced the themes of sin and purification early on in the physical poem. In fact it can now be argued that all of the fragments of the Purifications can be accommodated in the early part of book one of On Nature.

3. Physics and Cosmology

a. Physics

The foundations of Empedocles' physics lie in the assumption that there are four 'elements’ of matter, or ‘roots’ as he calls them, using a botanical metaphor that stresses their creative potential: earth, air, fire and water. These are able to create all things, including all living creatures, by being 'mixed' in different combinations and proportions. Each of the elements however, retains its own characteristics in the mixture, and each is eternal and unchanging. The positing of these four roots of matter forms part of a tradition of opposite material creative principles in Presocratic philosophy, but it also has its origins in an attempt to counter the theories of Parmenides who had argued that the world is single and unchanging since nothing can come from nothing and nothing can be destroyed into nothing: the theory known as Eleatic monism. Empedocles' response was to appropriate Parmenides’ ideas and to use them against themselves. Nothing can come from nothing nor be destroyed into nothing (fr. 12), and therefore, in order to rescue the reality of the phenomenal world, there must be assumed to exist something eternal and unchanging beneath the constant change, growth and decay of the visible world. Empedocles then, transfers the changelessness that Parmenides attributes to the entire world to his four elements, and replaces the static singularity Parmenides' world with a dynamic plurality. The four elements correspond closely to their expression at the macroscopic level of nature, with the traditional quadripartite division of the cosmos into earth, sea, air, and the fiery aether of the heavenly bodies: these four naturally occurring 'elements' of the cosmos clearly represent a fundamental natural division of matter at the largest scale. This division at the macroscopic level of reality is applied reductively at the microscopic level to produce a parallelism between the constituents of matter and the fundamental constituents of the cosmos, but the reduction of the world into four types of material particles does not deny the reality of the world we see, but instead validates it. Empedocles stresses this parallel between the elements at the different levels of reality by using the terms 'sun' ‘sea’ and ‘Earth’ interchangeably with ‘fire’, ‘water’ and ‘earth’. Of the four elements, although Empedocles stresses their equality of powers, fire is also granted a special role both in its hardening effect on mixtures of the other elements and also as the fundamental principle of living things.

b. Cosmology

Empedocles also posits two cosmic forces which work upon the elements in both creative and destructive ways. These he personifies as Love (Philia) - a force of attraction and combination – and Strife (Neikos) – a force of repulsion and separation. Whether these cosmic forces are to be envisaged in simply mechanistic terms as descriptions of the way things happen, or as expressions of internal properties of the elements, or as external forces that act upon the elements, is not clear. It is also unclear whether the two forces are to be seen as impersonal mechanistic physical forces or as intelligent divinities that act in purposive ways in creation and destruction. Evidence can be found for all these interpretations. What is clear is that these two forces are engaged in an eternal battle for domination of the cosmos and that they each prevail in turn in an endless cosmic cycle. The details of this cosmic cycle are also difficult to establish, but the most widely accepted interpretation is represented in the following diagram:

EmpGraph

Beginning from the top of the diagram and proceeding clockwise, when Love is completely dominant she draws all the elements fully together into a Sphere in which, although the elements are not fused together into a single mass, each is indistinguishable from the others. The Sphere then, is an a-cosmic state during which no matter can exist, and no life is possible. Then as Love's power gradually weakens and Strife begins to grow in power, he gradually separates out the elements from the Sphere until there is enough separation for matter to come into existence, for the world to be created and for all life to be born. When Strife has achieved total domination we again get an a-cosmic state in which the elements are separated completely and the world and all life is destroyed in a Whirl. Then Love begins to increase in power and to draw the elements together again, and as she does so the world is again created and life is again born. When Love has achieved full dominan ce we return once more to the sphere. As Empedocles puts it in fr. 17.1-8:

A twofold tale I shall tell: at one time it grew to be one only from many, and at another again it divided to be many from one. There is a double birth of what is mortal, and a double passing away; for the uniting of all things brings one generation into being and destroys it, and the other is reared and scattered as they are again being divided. And these things never cease their continuous exchange of position, at one time all coming together into one through Love, at another again being borne away from each other by Strife's repulsion.

The cosmos exists in a state of constant flux then, beneath which there is a certain sort of stability in the eternity of the elements. The world is in a constant state of organic evolution, and there appear to be two different creations and two different worlds which have no direct link between them. According the most widely accepted interpretation Empedocles considered that we ourselves inhabit the world under the increasing power of Strife.

4. Biology

Empedocles' physics have a particularly biological focus as is indicated by his choice of the botanical metaphor of 'roots’ for what were later called 'elements'. The term ‘roots’ stresses the creative potential of the roots rather than illustrating the way they create things by being mixed in different combinations: 'elements' (stoicheia in Greek, elementa in Latin) is the word for the letters of the alphabet, and is a metaphor that stresses the ability of the elements of matter to form different types of matter by interchange of position just as a limited number of letters are able to form all sorts of different words on the page. To illustrate this aspect of the creative abilities of his roots Empedocles uses an analogy with the way painters can use a limited number of colours to create all sorts of different colours and represent all the different productions of nature.
Fr. 23:

As painters, men well taught by wisdom in the practice of their art, decorate temple offerings when they take in their hands pigments of various colours, and after fitting them in close combination - more of some and less of others – they produce from them shapes resembling all things, creating trees and men and women, animals and birds and water-nourished fish, and long-lived gods too, highest in honor; so let not error convince you in your mind that there is any other source for the countless perishables that are seen, but know this clearly, since the account you have heard is divinely revealed.

Among other aspects, this analogy exhibits Empedocles' tendency to think about the creative abilities of the elements in terms of their biological products, here a characteristically Empedoclean list of creatures representing the different orders of nature: plants, humans, land animals, birds, and fish, as well as gods. If painters use a mixture of a small number of pigments to produce copies of the works of nature, then the same process is productive of those works of nature. In other ways as well in his presentation of the cosmic cycle and the endless combination and separation of the elements he tends to elide the distinction between the elements and the life-forms they produce. Just as in the parallel he draws between the elements of the cosmos on both microscopic and macroscopic levels, so a close parallel is drawn between living creatures and their constituent elements.

a. Origin of Species

Empedocles presents us with the earliest extant attempt at producing a detailed rational mechanism for the origin of species. Greek traditions include the aetiological myths of the origin of a particular species of animal by transformation from a human being (many of these ancient mythological aetiologies are collected by Ovid in the Metamorphoses). The origins of humans, or of particular heroes, founders of cities or of races is frequently explained by what I term a botanical analogy: they originally emerged autochthonously from the ground just as plants do today, and this is also standard in ancient scientific theories as well: the original spontaneous generation of life from the earth, with all creatures emerging in their present species. Empedocles attempts to provide a comprehensive mechanism for the origins not simply of humans or of a particular animal but of all animal life, including humans, and a rational mechanism that would seem to do away with the need for any design in creatures or any external agency to order them and separate them into their individual species.

In Strasbourg fr. a(ii) 23-30 we now find the following lines in which Empedocles seemingly introduces his account of zoogony:

I will show you to your eyes too, where they find a larger body: first the coming together and the unfolding of birth, and as many as are now remaining of this generation. This [is to be seen] among the wilder species of mountain-roaming beasts; this [is to be seen] in the twofold offspring of men, this [is to be seen] in the produce of the root-bearing fields and of the cluster of grapes mounting on the vine. From these convey to your mind unerring proofs of my account: for you will see the coming together and unfolding of birth.

Empedocles promises an exposition of zoogony and the origin of species which, from the examples he gives - wild animals, humans and plants - is clearly intended to encompass all animal and plant life, including humans. He appeals to present day species as proofs of his theories: we can see both the products of this process of zoogony around us in nature today and also, it seems, we can see the same processes still going on today. That the theory refers to present day species rather than creatures in some counter world is underlined by the stress Empedocles puts on 'as many as are now remaining of this generation'. So the theory is intended to explain the origin and development of all life and refers specifically to the animals and plants around us today, both as examples of and as proofs of the theory he will propose. This process of generation he describes by the repeated 'the coming together and the unfolding of birth'. This seems to posit two processes which work, either together or separately, to produce the life we see around us today: a process of coming together and also a process of unfolding or perhaps more strictly 'unleafing' since the metaphor originates from the leaves of plants. So the second part of this process of zoogony involves a botanical metaphor: just as in the traditional botanical analogy of the myths of autochthony, an appeal to the development and growth of plants is used to describe the process of the development of all life.

According to fragments B57, B59, B60, and B61, first of all individual limbs and organs were produced from the earth. These wandered separately at first and then under the combining power of Love they came together in all sorts of wild and seemingly random hybrid combinations, producing double fronted creatures, hermaphrodites, ox-faced man creatures and man-faced ox-creatures. This weird picture is explained by Aristotle in the Physics and later in more detail by Simplicius in his commentary on the Physics as a theory of the origin of species in which, as we would put it, a certain form of natural selection is operative. The creatures assembled wrongly from parts of disparate animals will die out, either immediately, or by being unable to breed, and only the creatures by chance put together from homogeneous limbs will survive and so go on to found the species that we see today. The production of species and their ordering then is explained by a mechanistic process long recognised as a forerunner of Darwin's theory of natural selection. Unlike in Darwin's theory however, there would seem to be no gradual evolution of one species into another, and all of the variety of nature is produced in a great burst of birth in the beginning and is then whittled down by extinctions into the creatures we see today. That this theory intends to account for the origins of both humans and animals is ensured by the component parts of the ox-headed man-creatures and man-headed ox-creatures. There will clearly also be created by this system man-headed man-creatures and ox-headed ox-creatures, that is to say normal oxen and normal humans, although they are not mentioned. Further evidence that this zoogony relates to present day creatures is given by Aristotle and Simplicius who tell us that this process is still going on today.

However, Empedocles also adds to this theory another explanation of the origins of humans very much along the lines of traditional myths of autochthony. In fr. B62 and Strasbourg fr. d he describes the 'shoots' of men and women arising from the earth, drawn up by fire as it separates out from the other elements during the creation under the power of increasing Strife. As his choice of the word 'shoots' indicates these are not yet fully articulated people with distinct limbs but ‘whole-nature forms’ that ‘did not as yet show the lovely shape of limbs, or voice or language native to man'. We may assume that as Strife increases in power these 'shoots’ will, just as plant buds do, gradually become fully articulated with distinct limbs and features. So human origins are accounted for by a botanical analogy, with humans as biological productions of the earth itself. This theory is also intended to account for modern-day as humans, as Strasbourg fr. d tells us 'even now daylight beholds their remains'. So both the creation under Love and the creation under Strife refer to the origins of modern plants, animals, and humans. This is problematic since according to the picture of the cosmic cycle given above the world created by Strife is quite separate from that created by Love, and two quite different explanations are given by Empedocles for each creation of life. Various attempts have been made to account for this, including a radical revision of the cosmic cycle in order to allow both creations of life to take place within the same world, and also seeing the two different worlds of the cosmic cycle as more useful devices for examining different aspects of creation separately than absolutely chronologically separate phases of a cycle: the work of Love in combining creatures and the work of Strife in articulating them would then actually take place at the same time, but are simply described as operative in chronologically separate phases.

b. Embryology

Empedocles is an exponent of the pangenetic theory of embryology. In this theory inheritance of characteristics from both mother and father is explained by each of the two parents' limbs and organs creating tiny copies of themselves. These miniature limbs and organs then flow together in the generative seed and when the two seeds combine in the womb the father's seed may provide the model for the nose, while the mother's seed the model for the eyes and so on. This is an elegant way of accounting for inheritance of characteristics, but this is unlikely to be the whole story. As Aristotle points out there are strong conceptual similarities between Empedocles' embryology and the creation under Love in which we see the coming together of pre-formed limbs creating life. So Empedocles thinks of the original formation of animals as a process analogous to the present day formation of the embryo in the womb. From his description in Strasbourg fr. a (ii) 23-30 'the coming together and unfolding of birth' we seem to have two processes that are at work in the formation of both present day creatures and the original creation of life. The 'coming together' describes both the original coming together of the limbs of the first creatures and also the coming together of the tiny limbs in conception. The other side of the creative process, the 'unfolding' is illustrated by the creation under Strife of the ‘shoots of men and pitiable women’ whose limbs are at first not fully articulated or defined: they will undergo a process of 'unfolding' just like plant buds and become fully developed humans. This 'unfolding' is clearly paralleled in embryology by the gradual development and growth of the embryo in the womb. Therefore it may be best to think of the tiny limbs and organs contained in the generative seed not as fully developed limbs and organs, but as the genetic material that contains the potential for the development of limbs and organs. This is so mewhat speculative, but would provide Empedocles with a much more nearly truly evolutionary theory of the origin of species than had previously been ascribed to him. Certainly the differentiation into the two sexes is described in terms of potential: the warmth of the womb determines whether the embryo will be male or female, cf. fr B 65: 'They were poured in pure places; some met with cold and became women', fr. B 67: 'For the male was warmer . . . this is the reason why men are dark, more powerfully built, and hairier’. It may be that other characteristics are also determined or informed by environmental factors as well.

c. Perception and Thought

Empedocles seems to have been the first philosopher to give a detailed explanation of the mechanism by which we perceive things. His theory, criticised by Aristotle and Theophrastus, is that all things give off effluences and that these enter pores in the sense organs. The pores and the effluences will be of varying shapes and sizes and so only certain effluences enter certain sense-organs if they meet pores of the correct size and shape to admit them. Further, perception is achieved by the attraction of similars: we perceive light colours with fire in the eye, dark colours with water, smell is achieved by the presence of breath in the nostrils etc.

As Theophrastus complains, perception is closely linked to thought by Empedocles, cf. fr. B109:

With earth, we perceive earth, with water water, with air divine fire, with fire destructive fire, with love love, and strife with baneful strife.

fr. B 107:

All things are fitted together and constructed out of these, and by means of them they think and feel pleasure and pain.

In B 109 Empedocles moves from perception of physical elements to ethical perceptions using the same theory of perception by similars, while in B 107 we can see the theory used to account more directly for thought itself. Hence for Empedocles there is a close link between what we perceive and what we think. Further our thoughts will also be affected by our own physical constitutions (B 108). This process of the attraction of like to like is operative from the most fundamental level with the parts of the roots of matter being attracted to their like, right up to the highest level of the purest mixture which is the highest form of thought. Hence it seems that everything in nature has a share in perception and intelligence, cf. fr. 110.10: 'know that all things have intelligence and a share of thought'.

5. Ethics and the Journey of the Soul

a. The Daimôns and Transmigration of Souls

Plutarch cites the following fragment as coming from 'the beginning of Empedocles' philosophy’, fr. B 115:

There is a decree of necessity, ratified long ago by gods, eternal and sealed by broad oaths, that whenever one in error, from fear, defiles his own limbs, having by his error made false the oath he swore - daimôns to whom life long-lasting is apportioned – he wanders from the blessed ones for three-times countless years, being born throughout the time as all kinds of mortal forms, exchanging one hard way of life for another. For the force of air pursues him into the sea, and sea spits him out onto earth's surface, earth casts him in the rays of blazing sun, and sun into the eddies of air; one takes him from another, and all abhor him. I too am now one of these, an exile from the gods and a wanderer, having put my trust in raving Strife.

Traditionally Plutarch's seeming attribution of this fragment to On Naturewas assumed to be incorrect and it was placed in the Purifications instead. However from the evidence of the Strasbourg fragments it seems that it may well be that Plutarch was correct, since they contain a description of the details of the sin Empedocles accuses himself of in fr. 115, cf. Strasbourg fr. d lines 5-6:

'Alas that merciless day did not destroy me sooner, before I devised with my claws terrible deeds for the sake of food'

In fr. 115 Empedocles describes himself as a 'daimôn', a being to whom long life has been granted, but who has committed the sin of meat-eating and bloodshed and consequently is punished by banishment from the company of the immortal gods. The banishment lasts three myriads of years, either 'three-times countless years' or thirty thousand years. In either case he must atone for his sin by being repeatedly reincarnated into all the different living forms of the different orders of nature. Elsewhere he says: 'For before now I have been at some time boy and girl, bush, bird, and a mute fish in the sea' (fr. B 117). Empedocles then, has already suffered this nearly endless cycle of reincarnations having been seemingly hurled down to the lowest rung of the scale of nature but has worked his way up, has been purified at last and, as he tells us in fr. B. 112, is himself now an immortal god. There are others too numbered among the daimôns, those who 'at the end ... come among men on earth as prophets, minstrels, physicians and leaders, and from these they arise as gods, highest in honour.' (fr. 146). It is not entirely clear whether we are meant to imagine the daimôns as an entirely separate class of blessed being with a different creation and a different fate from ourselves, the ordinary mortals, or as people who began as ordinary mortals but who, having purified themselves and having achieved perfection, are now approaching divine status. The latter reading would perhaps make more sense in terms of Empedocles' didactic ethical mission: if we are all potentially perfectable, then his purificatory teaching becomes much more crucial. Empedocles himself, as his life shows, has achieved all four of the states that qualify the daimôns for immortality, he is a prophet, a minstrel, a physician and a leader, and can now pass on his wisdom to those on earth whom he is about to leave behind when he rejoins the company of the immortals. As can be seen from the description above, there are strong similarities between Empedocles and the teachings of Pythagoras on the transmigration of souls. Empedocles is clearly a follower of Pythagoras, in his ethics and psychology at least, and shares his vegetarianism and pacifism.

b. Meat-eating and Sin

Slaughter and meat-eating are the most terrible of sins, indeed for him animal slaughter is murder and meat-eating is cannibalism, as shown by fr. 137:

The father will lift up his dear son in changed form, and blind fool, as he prays he will slay him, and those who take part in the sacrifice bring the victim as he pleads. But the father, deaf to his cries, slays him in his house and prepares an evil feast. In the same way son seizes father, and children their mother, and having bereaved them of life devour the flesh of those they love.

Here, in terms reminiscent of Hesiod's description of the coming horrors of the Iron Age in Works and Days, we see the appalling consequences of meat-eating: murder, cannibalism, the destruction of whole families and, by extrapolation, of entire societies. This is a radical position in both political and religious terms. Plato's Protagoras in the eponymous dialogue can simply assume that all men agree that warfare is 'a fine and noble thing'. For Empedocles warfare, one fundamental plank of the Greek city state, is the most appalling of all evils and is punished by the immortals by hurling the perpetrators not only out of their society, but out of human society and even down to the level of the lowest forms of nature.

c. Theology

In religious terms as well traditional animal sacrifice, another fundamental basis of Greek society, becomes the grossest impiety of all. A probably apocryphal tale reports that Empedocles sacrificed an ox made of honey and meal at Olympia, the religious heart of Greece: a pointed act of criticism of traditional religion. Further evidence for his radical theology lies in his appropriation of the names of the Olympian gods for his roots of matter and his cosmic forces. Implicitly he argues that the Olympian gods came into being as misinterpretations of the natural world: the real 'gods' are the elements of nature and the cosmic forces that direct their endless evolutionary cycle. His religious and ethical teachings then are of purification of the soul in an attempt to achieve perfection and unity with perfect Love. He pictures a time in the past, a sort of golden age, when this universal harmony existed, fr. B 128:

They did not have Ares as god or Kydoimos, nor king Zeus, nor Kronos, nor Poseidon but queen Kypris [Love]. Her they propitiated with holy images and painted animal figures, with perfumes of subtle fragrance and offerings of distilled myrrh and sweet-smelling frankincense, and pouring on the earth libations of golden honey. Their altar was not drenched by the unspeakable slaughter of bulls, but this was the greatest defilement among men - to bereave of life and eat noble limbs.

fr. B 130:

All creatures, both animals and birds, were tame and gentle to men, and bright was the flame of their friendship.

Originally people worshipped only one god, Love, and this resulted in universal harmony, even between humans and animals. Implicitly the argument runs that the worship of the Olympian gods he mentions, Ares, Zeus and Poseidon, and the sacrifices they demand have destroyed this harmony, resulting in worship also of Kydoimos, the personification of the noise of battle. Traditional religion with their sacrificial slaughter and meat-eating have had a degrading effect on society.

d. Physics and Theology

As I say above it now seems very likely that Empedocles discussed purificatory topics early on in his poem On Nature. Unlike for modern rationalists then, it seems that for Empedocles there was no fundamental divide between physics and religion. Indeed as can be seen from fr. B 115 above the sin of the daimôn results in an expiatory journey of the soul not only through the different orders of living creatures but through the physical elements of the cosmos. Empedocles draws a close analogy between the cycle of the soul and the cycle of the cosmos itself. This is a hallmark of his work: frequently he uses the same language whether describing the journey of the soul or the cycle of the elements. Sometimes in the Strasbourg fragments the description of the elements coming together under the power of Love is rendered as 'we are coming together'. His sin, in fr. 115, he describes as resulting from having put his trust in raving Strife, one of his cosmic forces, and conversely in fr. 130 we see the people of the golden age worshipping the other cosmic force, Love. Clearly there is more than a little cross-over between physics and ethics for Empedocles. How this works in detail is hard to pin down but perhaps the best reading we can give of On Natureis that it represents the detailed expression of the cycle of the soul at the level of the entire cosmos. The endless evolutionary cycling of the elements is in fact part of the cycle of the soul.

(Note: all translations are by M. R. Wright except those of the Strasbourg fragments which are by O. Primavesi and A. Martin.)

6. References and Further Reading

a. Texts and Commentaries

  • Bollack, J. Empédocle, (Paris, 1965-9), 4 vols. With Greek text, French translation, and commentary.
  • Diels, H. and W. Kranz, Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker (Berlin, 1952), vol. 1, ch. 31, 276-375. Greek text of both fragments (B) and testimonia (A) with German translation.
  • Wright, M. R. (2nd edn.), Empedocles the Extant Fragments (London, 1995). With Greek text, English translation, introduction and commentary.
  • Inwood, B. The Poem of Empedocles (Toronto, 1992). With Greek text, facing English translation and introduction.
  • Martin, A. and O. Primavesi, L'Empédocle de Strasbourg: (P. Strasb. gr. Inv. 1665-1666) (Berlin/Strasbourg, 1998). With Greek text, French and English translations, introduction, commentary, and English summary.

b. Studies

  • Gemelli Marciano, L. "Le 'demonologie' empedoclee: problemi di metodo e altro", Aevum Antiquum 1 (2003), 205-35
  • Gemelli Marciano, L. Le metamorfosi della tradizione: mutamenti de significato e neologismi nel Peri physeos di Empedocle (Bari, 1999).
  • Guthrie, W.K.C. A History of Greek Philosophy vol. 2 (Cambridge 1969), ch. 3
  • Kingsley, P. Ancient Philosophy, Mystery and Magic: Empedocles and Pythagorean Tradition (Oxford, 1995)
  • Kirk, G. S. and J.E. Raven, M. Schofield, (2nd edn.), The Presocratic Philosophers (Cambridge 1983), ch. 10.
  • O'Brien, D. Empedocles’ Cosmic Cycle (Cambridge, 1969)
  • Osborne, C. 'Empedocles recycled', Classical Quarterly NS 37 (1987), 24-50
  • Osbourne, C. 'Rummaging in the recycling bins of Upper Egypt: a discussion of A. Martin and O. Primavesi, ZL' Empédocle de Strasbourg', Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 18 (Oxford, 2000), 329-56.
  • Sedley, D. N. 'Empedocles' life cycles’, in Proceedings of the Symposium Tertium Mykonense (forthcoming, 2004)
  • Solmsen, F. 'Love and Strife in Empedocles' cosmology’, Phronesis 10 (1965), 123-45; repr. in R.E. Allen and D.J. Furley (eds), Studies in Presocratic Philosophy, (London, 1975), vol. 2, 221-64.
  • Trépanier, S. 'Empedocles on the ultimate symmetry of the world', Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 24 (2003), 1-57
  • Trépanier, S. Empedocles: An Interpretation (London, 2004)

Author Information

Gordon Campbell
Email: gordon.l.campbell@may.ie
National University of Ireland, Maynooth
Ireland

Epictetus (55–135 C.E.)

epictetusEpictetus (pronounced Epic-TEE-tus) was an exponent of Stoicism who flourished in the early second century C.E. about four hundred years after the Stoic school of Zeno of Citium was established in Athens. He lived and worked, first as a student in Rome, and then as a teacher with his own school in Nicopolis in Greece. Our knowledge of his philosophy and his method as a teacher comes to us via two works composed by his student Arrian, the Discourses and the Handbook. Although Epictetus based his teaching on the works of the early Stoics (none of which survives) which dealt with the three branches of Stoic thought, logic, physics and ethics, the Discourses and the Handbook concentrate almost exclusively on ethics. The role of the Stoic teacher was to encourage his students to live the philosophic life, whose end was eudaimonia ('happiness' or 'flourishing'), to be secured by living the life of reason, which – for Stoics – meant living virtuously and living 'according to nature'. The eudaimonia ('happiness') of those who attain this ideal consists of ataraxia (imperturbability), apatheia (freedom from passion), eupatheiai ('good feelings'), and an awareness of, and capacity to attain, what counts as living as a rational being should. The key to transforming oneself into the Stoic sophos (wise person) is to learn what is 'in one's power', and this is 'the correct use of impressions' (phantasiai), which in outline involves not judging as good or bad anything that appears to one. For the only thing that is good is acting virtuously (that is, motivated by virtue), and the only thing that is bad is the opposite, acting viciously (that is, motivated by vice). Someone who seeks to make progress as a Stoic (a prokoptôn) understands that their power of rationality is a fragment of God whose material body – a sort of rarefied fiery air – blends with the whole of creation, intelligently forming and directing undifferentiated matter to make the world as we experience it. The task of the prokoptôn, therefore, is to 'live according to nature', which means (a) pursuing a course through life intelligently responding to one's own needs and duties as a sociable human being, but also (b) wholly accepting one's fate and the fate of the world as coming directly from the divine intelligence which makes the world the best that is possible.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
    1. The Discourses
    2. The Handbook
  3. Epictetus' Stoicism
  4. Key Concepts
    1. The Promise of Philosophy
    2. What is Really Good
    3. What is in our Power
    4. Making Proper Use of Impressions
    5. The Three Topoi
      1. The Discipline of Desire
      2. The Discipline of Action
      3. The Discipline of Assent
    6. God
    7. On Living in Accord with Nature
    8. Metaphors for Life
    9. Making Progress
  5. Glossary of Terms
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Translations of Epictetus
    2. Translations of Hellenistic Philosophers, including the Stoics
    3. Items that Address Epictetus Specifically
    4. Items Addressing Stoic Philosophy and/or Hellenistic Ethics Generally
    5. Other Items on Hellenistic Philosophy Generally

1. Life

It is possible to draw only a basic sketch of Epictetus' life. Resources at our disposal include just a handful of references in the ancient texts, to which we can add the few allusions that Epictetus makes to his own life in the Discourses.

Epictetus was born in about 55 C.E. in Hierapolis in Phrygia (modern-day Pamukkale, in south-western Turkey). As a boy he somehow came to Rome as a slave of Epaphroditus who was a rich and powerful freedman, having himself been a slave of the Emperor Nero (he had been an administrative secretary). Whilst still a slave, Epictetus studied with the Stoic teacher Musonius Rufus.

There is a story told by the author Celsus (probably a younger contemporary of Epictetus) – quoted by the early Christian Origen (c.185–254) at Contra Celsum 7.53 – that when still a slave, Epictetus was tortured by his master who twisted his leg. Enduring the pain with complete composure, Epictetus warned Epaphroditus that his leg would break, and when it did break, he said, 'There, did I not tell you that it would break?' And from that time Epictetus was lame. The Suda (tenth century), however, although confirming that Epictetus was lame, attributes his affliction to rheumatism.

At some point Epictetus was manumitted, and in about 89, along with other philosophers then in Rome, was banished by the Emperor Domitian. He went to Nicopolis in Epirus (in north-western Greece) where he opened his own school which acquired a good reputation, attracting many upper-class Romans. One such student was Flavius Arrian (c.86–160) who would compose the Discourses and the Handbook, and who later served in public office under the Emperor Hadrian and made his mark as a respected historian (much of his writings survive). Origen (Contra Celsum 6.2) reports that Epictetus had been more popular in his day than had Plato in his. Aulus Gellius (c.125–c.165) reports that one of Marcus Aurelius' teachers, Herodes Atticus (c.101–177), considered Epictetus to be 'the greatest of Stoics' (Attic Nights 1.2.6).

Our sources report that Epictetus did not marry, had no children, and lived to an old age. With respect to marriage and children we may note the story from Lucian (Demonax 55) about the Cynic philosopher Demonax who had been a pupil of Epictetus. On hearing Epictetus exhort his students to marry and have children (for it was a philosopher's duty to provide a substitute ready for the time when they would die), he sarcastically asked Epictetus whether he could marry one of his daughters.

2. Writings

It appears that Epictetus wrote nothing himself. The works we have that present his philosophy were written by his student, Flavius Arrian. We may conjecture that the Discourses and the Handbook were written some time around the years 104–107, at the time when Arrian (born c.86) was most likely to have been a student.

Dobbin (1998), though, holds the view that the Discourses and the Handbook were actually written by Epictetus himself; the Suda does say, after all, that Epictetus 'wrote a great deal'. Dobbin is not entirely convinced by Arrian's claim in his dedicatory preface that he wrote down Epictetus' words verbatim; firstly, stenographic techniques at this time were primitive, and anyway were the preserve of civil servants; secondly, most of the discourses are too polished, and look too much like carefully crafted prose to be the product of impromptu discussions; and thirdly, some of the discourses (notably 1.29, 3.22 and 4.1) are too long for extempore conversations.

There is no way to resolve this question with certainty. Whether the texts we have do indeed represent a serious attempt to record Epictetus at work verbatim, whether draft texts were later edited and rewritten (as seems wholly likely), possibly by Epictetus, or whether Epictetus did in fact write the texts himself, drawing on his recollections as a lecturer with only occasional attempts at strictly verbatim accuracy, we shall never know. But what we can be certain of, regardless of who actually wrote the words onto the papyrus to make the first draft of the text as we have it today, is that those words were intended to present Stoic moral philosophy in the terms and the style that Epictetus employed as a teacher intent on bringing his students to philosophic enlightenment as the Stoics had understood this enterprise.

a. Discourses

Written in Koine Greek, the everyday contemporary form of the language, Epictetus' Discourses appear to record the exchanges between Epictetus and his students after formal teaching had concluded for the day. Internal textual evidence confirms that the works of the early Stoic philosophers (Zeno, Cleanthes and Chrysippus) were read and discussed in Epictetus' classes, but this aspect of Epictetus' teaching is not recorded by Arrian. What we have, then, are intimate, though earnest, discussions in which Epictetus aims to make his students consider carefully what the philosophic life – for a Stoic – consists in, and how to live it oneself. He discusses a wide range of topics, from friendship to illness, from fear to poverty, on how to acquire and maintain tranquillity, and why we should not be angry with other people.

Not all of the Discourses appear to have survived, as the ancient Byzantine scholar Photius (c.810–c.893) reports that the complete text originally comprised eight books, whereas all we have today are four books. Because the text, chapter by chapter, jumps to different topics and shows no orderly development, it is not readily apparent that anything is missing, and indeed, the reference to eight books may be mistaken (though another author, Aulus Gellius, at Attic Nights 19.1.14, refers to the fifth book of the Discourses). The range of topics is sufficiently broad for us to be reasonably confident that, even if some of the text has been lost, what we lack by and large repeats and revisits the material that we have in the book as it has come down to us. (To find translations of the Discourses on-line, please visit my 'Translations of Epictetus on the Internet' page at my BT site or my Geocities site.)

b. The Handbook

This little book appears to be an abstract of the Discourses, focusing on key themes in Epictetus' teaching of Stoic ethics. Some of the text is taken from the Discourses, and the fact that not all of it can be correlated with passages in the larger work supports the view that some of the Discourses has indeed been lost. (To find translations of the Handbook on-line, please visit my 'Translations of Epictetus on the Internet' page at my BT site or my Geocities site.)

3. Epictetus' Stoicism

The writings of the early Stoics, of Zeno (335–263 B.C.E.) the founder of the school, of Chrysippus (c.290–207 B.C.E.) the extremely influential third head of the Stoa, and of others, survive only as quoted fragments found in later works. The question arises as to what extent Epictetus preserved the original doctrines of the Stoic school, and to what extent, if any, he branched out with new emphases and innovations of his own. The nineteenth-century Epictetan scholar Adolf Bonhöffer (1998, 3) remarks: '[Epictetus] is completely free of the eclecticism of Seneca and Marcus Aurelius; and, compared with his teacher Musonius Rufus … his work reveals a considerably closer connection to Stoic doctrine and terminology as developed mainly by Chrysippus.' Evidence internal to the Discourses indicates that Epictetus was indeed faithful to the early Stoics. At 1.4.28–31, Epictetus praises Chrysippus in the highest terms, saying of him, 'How great the benefactor who shows the way! … who has discovered, and brought to light, and communicated, the truth to all, not merely of living, but of living well' (trans. Hard). It would be inconsistent, if not wholly ridiculous, to laud Chrysippus in such terms and then proceed to depart oneself from the great man's teaching. At 1.20.15, Epictetus quotes Zeno, and at 2.6.9–10 he quotes Chrysippus, to support his arguments. Aulus Gellius (Attic Nights 19.1.14) says that Epictetus' Discourses 'undoubtedly agree with the writings of Zeno and Chrysippus'.

Scholars are agreed that the 'doctrine of the three topics (topoi)' (fields of study) which we find in the Discourses originates with Epictetus (see Bonhöffer 1996, 32; Dobbin 1998, xvii; Hadot 1998, 83; More 1923, 107). Oldfather (1925, xxi, n. 1), in the introduction to his translation of the Discourses, remarks that 'this triple division … is the only notable original element … found in Epictetus, and it is rather a pedagogical device for lucid presentation than an innovation in thought'. Our enthusiasm for this division being wholly original to Epictetus should be tempered with a reading of extracts from Seneca's Moral Letters (75.8–18 and 89.14–15) where we also find a threefold division of ethics which, although not exactly similar to Epictetus' scheme, suggests the possibility that both Seneca and Epictetus drew on work by their predecessors that, alas, has not survived. Suffice it so say, what Epictetus teaches by means of his threefold division is wholly in accord with the principles of the early Stoics, but how he does this is uniquely his own method. The programme of study and exercises that Epictetus' students adhered to was in consequence different from the programme that was taught by his predecessors, but the end result, consisting in the special Stoic outlook on oneself and the world at large and the ability to 'live the philosophic life', was the same.

4. Key Concepts

a. The Promise of Philosophy

Epictetus, along with all other philosophers of the Hellenistic period, saw moral philosophy as having the practical purpose of guiding people towards leading better lives. The aim was to live well, to secure for oneself eudaimonia ('happiness' or 'a flourishing life'), and the different schools and philosophers of the period offered differing solutions as to how the eudaimôn life was to be won.

No less true of us today than it was for the ancients, few people are content with life (let alone wholly content), and what contributes to any contentment that may be enjoyed is almost certainly short-lived and transient.

The task for the Stoic teacher commences with the understanding that (probably) everyone is not eudaimôn for much, or even all, of the time; that there is a reason for this being the case and, most importantly, that there are solutions that can remedy this sorry state of affairs.

Indeed, Epictetus metaphorically speaks of his school as being a hospital to which students would come seeking treatments for their ills (Discourses 3.23.30). Each of us, in consequence merely of being human and living in society, is well aware of what comprise these ills. In the course of daily life we are beset by frustrations and setbacks of every conceivable type. Our cherished enterprises are hindered and thwarted, we have to deal with hostile and offensive people, and we have to cope with the difficulties and anxieties occasioned by the setbacks and illnesses visited upon our friends and relations. Sometimes we are ill ourselves, and even those who have the good fortune to enjoy sound health have to face the fact of their own mortality. In the midst of all this, only the rare few are blessed with lasting and rewarding relationships, and even these relationships, along with everything that constitutes a human life, are wholly transient.

But what is philosophy? Does it not mean making preparation to meet the things that come upon us? (Discourses 3.10.6, trans. Oldfather)

The ills we suffer, says Epictetus, result from mistaken beliefs about what is truly good. We have invested our hope in the wrong things, or at least invested it in the wrong way. Our capacity to flourish and be happy (to attain eudaimonia) is entirely dependent upon our own characters, how we dispose ourselves to ourselves, to others, and to events generally. What qualities our characters come to have is completely up to us. Therefore, how well we flourish is also entirely up to us.

b. What is Really Good

The central claim of Stoic ethics is that only the virtues and virtuous activities are good, and that the only evil is vice and actions motivated by vice (see Discourses 2.9.15 and 2.19.13). When someone pursues pleasure or wealth, say, believing these things to be good, the Stoics hold that this person has made a mistake with respect to the nature of the things pursued and the nature of their own being, for the Stoics deny that advantages such as pleasure and health (wealth and status, and so forth) are good, because they do not benefit those who possess them in all circumstances. Virtue, on the other hand, conceived as the capacity to use such advantages wisely, being the only candidate for that which is always beneficial, is held to be the only good thing (see Plato, Euthydemus 278e–281e and Meno 87c–89a).

Thus, the Stoics identify the eudaimôn ('happy') life as one that is motivated by virtue. The term we translate as 'virtue' (from the Latin virtus) is aretê, and means 'excellence'. To progress towards excellence as a human being, for Epictetus, means understanding the true nature of one's being and keeping one's prohairesis (moral character) in the right condition. Epictetus uses the term aretê only occasionally, and whereas the early Stoics spoke of striving for excellence as what was proper for a rational creature and required for eudaimonia ('happiness' or well-being), Epictetus speaks of striving to maintain one's prohairesis in proper order (see Discourses 1.4.18 and 1.29.1).

Although things such as material comfort, for instance, will be pursued by the Stoic student who seeks eudaimonia, they will do this in a different way from those not living the 'philosophic life' – for Stoics claim that everything apart from virtue (what is good) and vice (what is bad) is indifferent, that is, 'indifferent' with regard to being good or bad. It is how one makes use of indifferent things that establishes how well one is making progress towards aretê (moral excellence) and a eudaimôn ('happy') life.

Indifferent things are either 'preferred' or 'dispreferred'. Preferred are health and wealth, friends and family, and pretty much all those things that most people pursue as desirable for leading a flourishing life. Dispreferred are their opposites: sickness and poverty, social exclusion, and pretty much all those things that people seek to avoid as being detrimental for a flourishing life. Thus, the preferred indifferents have value for a Stoic, but not in terms of their being good: they have an instrumental value with respect to their capacities to contribute to a flourishing life as the objects upon which our virtuous actions are directed (see Discourses 1.29.2). The Stoic does not lament their absence, for their presence is not constitutive of eudaimonia. What is good is the virtuous use one makes of such preferred things should they be to hand, but no less good are one's virtuous dispositions in living as well as one may, even when they are lacking.

c. What is in our Power

To maintain our prohairesis (moral character) in the proper condition – the successful accomplishment of this being necessary and sufficient for eudaimonia ('happiness') – we must understand what is eph' hêmin ('in our power' or 'up to us'; see Discourses 1.22.9–16). If we do not do this, our prohairesis will remain in a faulty condition, for we will remain convinced that things such as wealth and status are good when they are really indifferent, troubled by frustrations and anxieties, subject to disturbing emotions we do not want and cannot control, all of which make life unpleasant and unrewarding, sometimes overwhelmingly so. This is why Epictetus remarks: 'This is the proper goal, to practise how to remove from one's life sorrows and laments, and cries of "Alas" and "Poor me", and misfortune and disappointment' (Discourses 1.4.23, trans. Dobbin).

No one is master of another's prohairesis [moral character], and in this alone lies good and evil. No one, therefore, can secure the good for me, or involve me in evil, but I alone have authority over myself in these matters. (Discourses 4.12.7–8, trans. Dobbin)

What is in our power, then, is the 'authority over ourselves' that we have regarding our capacity to judge what is good and what is evil. Outside our power are 'external things', which are 'indifferent' with respect to being good or evil. These indifferents, as we saw in the previous section, number those things that are conventionally deemed to be good and those that are conventionally deemed to be bad. Roughly, they are things that 'just happen', and they are not in our power in the sense that we do not have absolute control to make them occur just as we wish, or to make them have exactly the outcomes that we desire. Thus, for example, sickness is not in our power because it is not wholly up to us whether we get sick, and how often, nor whether we will recover quickly or indeed at all. Now, it makes sense to visit a doctor when we feel ill, but the competence of the doctor is not in our power, and neither is the effectiveness of any treatment that we might be offered. So generally, it makes sense to manage our affairs carefully and responsibly, but the ultimate outcome of any affair is, actually, not in our power.

What is in our power is the capacity to adapt ourselves to all that comes about, to judge anything that is 'dispreferred' not as bad, but as indifferent and not strong enough to overwhelm our strength of character.

The Handbook of Epictetus begins with these words:

Some things are up to us [eph' hêmin] and some things are not up to us. Our opinions are up to us, and our impulses, desires, aversions–in short, whatever is our own doing. Our bodies are not up to us, nor are our possessions, our reputations, or our public offices, or, that is, whatever is not our own doing. (Handbook 1.1, trans. White)

That is, we have power over our own minds. The opinions we hold of things, the intentions we form, what we value and what we are averse to are all wholly up to us. Although we may take precautions, whether our possessions are carried off by a thief is not up us (but the intention to steal, that of course is in the power of the thief), and our reputations, in whatever quarter, must be decided by what other people think of us, and what they do think is up to them. Remaining calm in the face of adversity and controlling our emotions no matter what the provocation (qualities of character that to this day are referred to as 'being stoical'), are accomplished in the full Stoic sense, for Epictetus, by making proper use of impressions.

d. Making Proper Use of Impressions

To have an impression is to be aware of something in the world. For example, I may look out of my window and have the impression of an airship floating over the houses in the distance. Whether there is really an airship there, half a mile off, or whether there is just a little helium-filled model tied to my garden gate by a bit of string, is a separate question. 'Making proper use of impressions' concerns how we move from the first thing, being aware of something or other, to the second thing, making a judgement that something or other is the case. The Stoic stands in sharp contrast to the non-Stoic, for when the latter faces some disaster, say (let us imagine that their briefcase has burst open and their papers are scattered by the wind all along the station platform and onto the track), they will judge this a terrible misfortune and have the appropriate emotional response to match. Epictetus would declare that this person has made the wrong use of their impression.

In the first place, do not allow yourself to be carried away by [the] intensity [of your impression]: but say, 'Impression, wait for me a little. Let me see what you are, and what you represent. Let me test you.' Then, afterwards, do not allow it to draw you on by picturing what may come next, for if you do, it will lead you wherever it pleases. But rather, you should introduce some fair and noble impression to replace it, and banish this base and sordid one. (Discourses 2.18.24–5, trans. Hard)

Few non-Stoics, ignorant of Epictetus' teaching, would do other than rush around after their papers, descending deeper and deeper into a panic, imagining their boss at work giving them a dressing down for losing the papers, making them work extra hours to make good the loss, and perhaps even dismissing them from their job. The Stoic, by contrast, tests their impression to see what the best interpretation should be: losing the papers is a dispreferred indifferent, to be sure, but having an accident of this sort is bound to happen once in a while, and is nothing to be troubled about. They will quietly gather up the papers they can, and instead of panicking with respect to facing their boss, they will rehearse a little speech about having had an accident and what it means to have lost the papers. If their boss erupts in a temper, well, that is a concern for the boss.

Our attaining the eudaimôn ('happy') life requires that we judge things in the right way, for 'what disturbs men's minds is not events but their judgements on events' (Handbook 5, trans. Matheson).

Remember that foul words or blows in themselves are no outrage, but your judgement that they are so. So when any one makes you angry, know that it is your own thought that has angered you. Wherefore make it your endeavour not to let your impressions carry you away. For if once you gain time and delay, you will find it easier to control yourself. (Handbook 20, trans. Matheson)

e. The Three Topoi

The three topoi (fields of study) establish activities in which the prokoptôn (Stoic student) applies their Stoic principles; they are practical exercises or disciplines that when successfully followed are constitutive of the eudaimôn ('happy') life which all rational beings are capable of attaining.

There are three areas of study, in which a person who is going to be good and noble must be trained. That concerning desires and aversions, so that he may never fail to get what he desires nor fall into what he would avoid. That concerning the impulse to act and not to act, and, in general, appropriate behaviour; so that he may act in an orderly manner and after due consideration, and not carelessly. The third is concerned with freedom from deception and hasty judgement, and, in general, whatever is connected with assent. (Discourses 3.2.1–2, trans. Hard)

Our capacity to employ these disciplines in the course of daily life is eph' hêmin ('in our power' or 'up to us') because they depend on our opinions, judgements, intentions and desires which concern the way we regard things over which our prohairesis (moral character) has complete control.

i. The Discipline of Desire

The first discipline concerns what someone striving for excellence as a rational being should truly believe is worthy of desire, which for the Stoics is that which is truly good, virtue and action motivated by virtue.

Of these [three areas of study], the principle, and most urgent, is that which has to do with the passions; for these are produced in no other way than by the disappointment of our desires, and the incurring of our aversions. It is this that introduces disturbances, tumults, misfortunes, and calamities; and causes sorrow, lamentation and envy; and renders us envious and jealous, and thus incapable of listening to reason. (Discourses 3.2.3, trans. Hard)

Epictetus remarks: 'When I see a man anxious, I say, What does this man want? If he did not want some thing which is not in his power, how could he be anxious?' (Discourses 2.13.1, trans. Long). Those things that most of us, most of the time, seek after as being desirable, what we consider will make our lives go well, are things that are not in our power, and thus the hope we have for securing these things is placed in the hands of others or in the hands of fate. And when we are thwarted in our efforts to gain what we desire we become frustrated (or depressed or envious or angry, or all of these things). To be afflicted with such 'passions', says Epictetus, is the only real source of misery for human beings. Instead of trying to relieve ourselves of these unpleasant emotions by pressing all the harder to secure what we desire, we should rather place our hope not in 'external' things that are not in our power, but in our own dispositions and moral character. In short, we should limit our desire to virtue and to becoming (to the best of our capacities) examples of 'excellence'. If we do not do this, the inevitable result is that we will continue to desire what we may fail to obtain or lose once we have it, and in consequence suffer the unhappiness of emotional disquiet (or worse). And as is the common experience of all people at some time or other, when we are in the grip of such emotions we run the risk of becoming blind to the best course of action, even when construed in terms of pursuing 'external' things.

The Stoic prokoptôn, in contrast, sets their hopes on excellence, recognising that this is where their power over things lies. They will still pursue those 'preferred indifferent external' things that are needed for fulfilling those functions and projects that they deem appropriate for them as individuals, and those they have obligations to meet. But they will not be distressed at setbacks or failure, nor at obstructive people, nor at other difficulties (illness, for instance), for none of these things is entirely up to them, and they engage in their affairs in full consciousness of this fact. It is in maintaining this consciousness of what is truly good (virtue), and awareness that the indifferent things are beyond their power, that makes this a discipline for the Stoic prokoptôn.

ii. The Discipline of Action

The second discipline concerns our 'impulses to act and not to act', that is, our motivations, and answers the question as to what we each should do as an individual in our own unique set of circumstances to successfully fulfil the role of a rational, sociable being who is striving for excellence.

The outcome of our actions is not wholly in our power, but our inclination to act one way rather than another, to pursue one set of objectives rather than others, this is in our power. The Stoics use the analogy of the archer shooting at a target to explain this notion. The ideal, of course, is to hit the centre of the target, though accomplishing this is not entirely in the archer's power, for she cannot be certain how the wind will deflect the arrow from its path, nor whether her fingers will slip, nor whether (for it is within the bounds of possibility) the bow will break. The excellent archer does all within her power to shoot well, and she recognises that doing her best is the best she can do. The Stoic archer strives to shoot excellently, and will not be disappointed if she shoots well but fails to hit the centre of the target. And so it is in life generally. The non-Stoic views their success in terms of hitting the target, whereas the Stoic views their success in terms of having shot well (see Cicero, On Ends 3.22).

The [second area of study] has to do with appropriate action. For I should not be unfeeling like a statue, but should preserve my natural and acquired relations as a man who honours the gods, as a son, as a brother, as a father, as a citizen. (Discourses 3.2.4, trans. Hard)

Appropriate acts are in general measured by the relations they are concerned with. 'He is your father.' This means that you are called upon to take care of him, give way to him in all things, bear with him if he reviles or strikes you.
'But he is a bad father.'
Well, have you any natural claim to a good father? No, only to a father.
'My brother wrongs me.'
Be careful then to maintain the relation you hold to him, and do not consider what he does, but what you must do if your purpose is to keep in accord with nature. (Handbook 30, trans. Matheson)

The actions we undertake, Epictetus says, should be motivated by the specific obligations that we have in virtue of who we are, our natural relations to others, and what roles we have adopted in our dealings with the wider community (see Discourses 2.10.7–13). Put simply, our interest to live well as rational beings obliges us to act virtuously, to be patient, considerate, gentle, just, self-disciplined, even-tempered, dispassionate, unperturbed, and when necessary, courageous. This returns us to the central Stoic notion that the eudaimôn ('happy') life is realised by those who are motivated by virtue. The Discipline of Action points out to the prokoptôn how this should be applied in our practical affairs.

Epictetus sums up the first two disciplines:

We must have these principles ready to hand. Without them we must do nothing. We must set our mind on this object: pursue nothing that is outside us, nothing that is not our own, even as He that is mighty has ordained: pursuing what lies within our will [prohairetika], and all else [i.e., indifferent things] only so far as it is given to us. Further, we must remember who we are, and by what name we are called, and must try to direct our acts [kathêkonta] to fit each situation and its possibilities.
We must consider what is the time for singing, what the time for play, and in whose presence: what will be unsuited to the occasion; whether our companions are to despise us, or we to despise ourselves: when to jest, and whom to mock at: in a word, how one ought to maintain one's character in society. Wherever you swerve from any of these principles, you suffer loss at once; not loss from without, but issuing from the very act itself. (Discourses 4.12.15–18, trans. Matheson)

The loss here is of course loss of eudaimonia.

Failing to 'remember who we are' will result in our failing to pursue those actions appropriate to our individual circumstances and commitments. Epictetus says that this happens because we forget what 'name' we have (son, brother, councillor, etc.), 'for each of these names, if rightly considered, always points to the acts appropriate to it' (Discourses 2.10.11, trans. Hard). To progress in the Discipline of Action, then, the prokoptôn must be conscious, moment by moment, of (a) which particular social role they are playing, and (b) which actions are required or appropriate for fulfilling that role to the highest standard.

iii. The Discipline of Assent

This exercise focuses on 'assenting to impressions', and continues the discussion already introduced in the section above on making proper use of impressions. 'Assent' translates the Greek sunkatathesis, which means 'approve', 'agree', or 'go along with'. Thus, when we assent to an impression (phantasia) we are committing ourselves to it as a correct representation of how things are, and are saying, 'Yes, this is how it is.' The Discipline of Assent, then, is an exercise applied to our impressions in which we interpret and judge them in order to move from having the impression of something or other, to a declaration that such-and-such is the case.

The third area of study has to do with assent, and what is plausible and attractive. For, just as Socrates used to say that we are not to lead an unexamined life [see Plato, Apology 38a], so neither are we to accept an unexamined impression, but to say, 'Stop, let me see what you are, and where you come from', just as the night-watch say, 'Show me your token.' (Discourses 3.12.14–15, trans. Hard)

Make it your study then to confront every harsh impression with the words, 'You are but an impression, and not at all what you seem to be'. Then test it by those rules that you possess; and first by this–the chief test of all–'Is it concerned with what is in our power or with what is not in our power?' And if it is concerned with what is not in our power, be ready with the answer that it is nothing to you. (Handbook 1.5, trans. Matheson)

And we should do this with a view to avoiding falling prey to subjective (and false) evaluations so that we can be free from deception and from making rash judgements about how to proceed in the first two disciplines. For if we make faulty evaluations we will end up (with respect to the first discipline) having desires for the wrong things (namely, 'indifferents'), and (with respect to the second discipline) acting inappropriately with regard to our duties and obligations. This is why Epictetus remarks that the third topic 'concerns the security of the other two' (Discourses 3.2.5, trans. Long).

Epictetus runs through a number of imaginary situations to show how we should be alert to the dangers of assenting to poorly evaluated impressions:

… We ought … to exercise ourselves daily to meet the impressions of our senses …. So-and-so's son is dead. Answer, 'That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.' His father has disinherited So-and-so; what do you think of it? 'That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.' Caesar has condemned him. 'That lies outside the sphere of the moral purpose, it is not an evil.' He was grieved at all this. 'That lies within the sphere of the moral purpose, it is an evil.' He has borne up under it manfully. 'That lies within the sphere of the moral purpose, it is a good.' Now, if we acquire this habit, we shall make progress; for we shall never give our assent to anything but that of which we get a convincing sense-impression. His son is dead. What happened? His son is dead. Nothing else? Not a thing. His ship is lost. What happened? His ship is lost. He was carried off to prison. What happened? He was carried off to prison. But the observation: 'He has fared ill,' is an addition that each man makes on his own responsibility. (Discourses 3.8.1–5, trans. Oldfather)

What we must avoid, then, is adding to our impressions immediately and without proper evaluation any notion that something good or bad is at hand. For the only thing that is good is moral virtue, and the only harm that anyone can come to is to engage in affairs motivated by vice. Thus, to see the loss of a ship as a catastrophe would count as assenting to the wrong impression, for the impression that we have is that of just a ship being lost. To take the extra step of declaring that this is a misfortune and harmful would be to assent to an impression that is not in fact present, and would be a mistake. The loss of a ship, for a Stoic, is nothing more than a dispreferred indifferent, and does not constitute a harm.

f. God

For Epictetus, the terms 'God', 'the gods', and 'Zeus' are used interchangeably, and they appear frequently in the Discourses. In the Handbook, God is discussed as the 'captain' who calls us back on board ship, the subsequent voyage being a metaphor for our departure from life (see Handbook 7). God is also portrayed as 'the Giver' to whom we should return all those things we have enjoyed on loan when we lose close relatives or friends who die, and when we lose our possessions through misfortune (see Discourses 4.10.16 and Handbook 11).

If the Stoic making progress (the prokoptôn) understands God, the universe, and themselves in the right way, they 'will never blame the gods, nor find fault with them' (Handbook 31.1, trans. Oldfather):

Will you be angry and discontented with the ordinances of Zeus, which he, with the Fates who spun in his presence the thread of your destiny at the time of your birth, ordained and appointed? (Discourses 1.12.25, trans. Hard)

Indeed, they will pray to God to lead them to the fate that He has assigned them:

Lead me, Zeus, and you too, Destiny,
Wherever I am assigned by you;
I'll follow and not hesitate,
But even if I do not wish to,
Because I'm bad, I'll follow anyway.
(Handbook 53, trans. White = extract from Cleanthes' Hymn to Zeus)

[For] God has stationed us to a certain place and way of life. (Discourses 1.9.24, trans. Dobbin)

Epictetus presents orthodox Stoic views on God. His justification for believing in God is expressed essentially along the lines of what we recognise as an argument from design. The order and harmony that we can perceive in the natural world (from astronomical events to the way plants grow and fruit in season) is attributed to a divine providence that orders and controls the entire cosmos intelligently and rationally (see Discourses 1.6.1–11, 1.14.1–6, 1.16.7–8 and 2.14.11/25–7). The Stoics were materialists, and God is conceived of as a type of fiery breath that blends perfectly with all other matter in the universe. In doing this, God transforms matter from undifferentiated 'stuff' into the varied forms that we see around us. This process is continuous, and God makes the world as it is, doing what it does, moment by moment. Just as the soul of a person is understood to bring alive and animate what would otherwise be dead and inert matter, so God is thought of as the 'soul of the world', and the universe is thought of as a sort of animal.

Stoics hold that the mind of each person is quite literally a fragment (apospasma) of God (see Discourses 2.8.11), and that the rationality that we each possess is in fact a fragment of God's rationality; and this Epictetus primarily identifies as the capacity we have to make proper use of impressions (see Discourses 1.1.12). Epictetus expresses this in terms of what God has 'given us'; He is conceived of as having constructed the universe in such a way that we have in our possession all that is within the compass of our own character or moral choice and nothing else, but this is no reason for complaint:

What has He given me for my own and subject to my authority, and what has He left for Himself? Everything within the sphere of the moral purpose He has given me, subjected them to my control, unhampered and unhindered. My body that is made of clay, how could He make that unhindered? Accordingly He has made it subject to the revolution of the universe–[along with] my property, my furniture, my house, my children, my wife. … But how should I keep them? In accordance with the terms upon which they have been given, and for as long as they can be given. But He who gave also takes away. …
And so, when you have received everything, and your very self, from Another [i.e., God], do you yet complain and blame the Giver, if He take something away from you? (Discourses 4.1.100–3, with omissions, trans. Oldfather)

The capacity that the prokoptôn has for understanding, accepting, and embracing this state of affairs, that this is indeed the nature of things, is another of the main foundation stones of Stoic ethics.

g. On Living in Accord with Nature

The outlook adopted and the activities performed by the Stoic student in pursuit of excellence, as detailed in the sections above, are frequently referred to collectively by Epictetus (following the Stoic tradition) as 'following nature' or 'living in harmony with nature'. The Stoic prokoptôn maintains his 'harmony with nature' by being aware of why he acts as he does in terms of both (a) what his appropriate actions are, and (b) accepting what fate brings. If, for example, the prokoptôn is berated unfairly by his brother, he will not respond with angry indignation, for this would be 'contrary to nature', for nature has determined how brothers should rightly act towards each other (see Discourses 3.10.19–20). The task the Stoic student shoulders is to pursue actions appropriate to him as a brother, despite all and any provocation to act otherwise (see Handbook 30). This, for Epictetus, is a major component of what it means to keep one's prohairesis (moral character) in harmony with nature (see Discourses 1.6.15, 3.1.25 and 3.16.15).

Keeping ourselves in harmony with nature requires that we focus on two things. Firstly, we must pay attention to our own actions so that we respond appropriately, and secondly we must pay attention to the world in which our actions take effect and which prompts those actions in the first place.

When you are about to undertake some action, remind yourself what sort of action it is. If you are going out for a bath, put before your mind what commonly happens at the baths: some people splashing you, some people jostling, others being abusive, and others stealing. So you will undertake this action more securely if you say to yourself, 'I want to have a bath and also to keep my choice [prohairesis] in harmony with nature.' And do likewise in everything you undertake. So, if anything gets in your way when you are having your bath, you will be ready to say, 'I wanted not only to have a bath but also to keep my choice [prohairesis] in harmony with nature; and I shall not keep it so if I get angry at what happens.' (Handbook 4, trans. Hard)

In this extract about going to the baths, Epictetus focuses more on accepting what fate brings, saying that we should anticipate the sorts of things that can happen, so that when they do we will not be surprised and will not be angry. In other situations, anticipation of trouble or misfortune is impossible, but all the same, the Stoic will accept their fate as what God has ordained for them, and this for Epictetus is the very essence of keeping in harmony with nature (see Discourses 1.4.18–21).

It is circumstances (difficulties) which show what men are. Therefore when a difficulty falls upon you, remember that God, like a trainer of wrestlers, has matched you with a rough young man. For what purpose? you may say. Why, that you may become an Olympic conqueror; but it is not accomplished without sweat. In my opinion no man has had a more profitable difficulty than you have had, if you choose to make use of it as an athlete would deal with a young antagonist. (Discourses 1.24.1–2, trans. Long)

Every problem we face in life should be understood as a new opportunity to strengthen our moral character, just as every new bout for the wrestler provides an opportunity for them to train their skill in wrestling.

To be instructed is this, to learn to wish that every thing may happen as it does. And how do things happen? As the disposer [i.e., God] has disposed them. And he has appointed summer and winter, and abundance and scarcity, and virtue and vice, and all such opposites for the harmony of the whole; and to each of us he has given a body, and parts of the body, and possessions, and companions.
Remembering then this disposition of things, we ought to go to be instructed, not that we may change the constitution of things, – for we have not the power to do it, nor is it better that we should have the power, – but in order that, as the things around us are what they are and by nature exist, we may maintain our minds in harmony with the things which happen. (Discourses 1.12.15–17, trans. Long)

The wise and good man … submits his own mind to him who administers the whole [i.e., God], as good citizens do to the law of the state. He who is receiving instruction ought to come to be instructed with this intention, How shall I follow the gods in all things, how shall I be contented with the divine administration, and how can I become free? For he is free to whom every thing happens according to his will [prohairesis], and whom no man can hinder. (Discourses 1.12.7–9, trans. Long)

In this last extract we see Epictetus refer to the ideal Stoic practice as that of 'following the gods'. This means essentially the same as 'following nature', for God, who is immanent in the world (as the Stoics understand it) is identified with the way the world manifests, so if one follows nature, one must also be following God (see Discourses 1.20.15, 1.30.4, 4.7.20 and 4.10.14).

h. Metaphors for Life

Epictetus employs a number of metaphors to illustrate what the Stoic attitude to life should be.

 

Life as a festival

Epictetus encourages us to think of life as a festival, arranged for our benefit by God, as something that we can live through joyously, able to put up with any hardships that befall us because we have our eye on the larger spectacle that is taking place. Epictetus asks his students:

Who are you, and for what purpose have you come? Was it not he [i.e., God] who brought you here? … And as what did he bring you here? Was it not as a mortal? Was it not as one who would live, with a little portion of flesh, upon this earth, and behold his governance and take part with him, for a short time, in his pageant and his festival? (Discourses 4.1.104, trans. Hard)

The whole thrust of Stoic ethics aims to persuade us that we should ourselves contribute to the festival by living as well as we may and fulfilling our duties as sociable citizens of God's 'great city of the universe' (Discourses 3.22.4, trans. Hard). (See also Discourses 1.12.21, 2.14.23 and 4.4.24–7/46.)

 

Life as a game

. At Discourses 2.5.2, in encouraging his students to appreciate that external things are indifferent (being neither good nor bad), Epictetus says that we should imitate those who play dice, for neither the dice nor the counters have any real value; what matters, and what is either good or bad, is the way we play the game. Similarly at 2.5.15–20, where Epictetus discusses the example of playing a ball game, no one considers for a moment whether the ball itself is good or bad, but only whether they can throw and catch it with the appropriate skill. What matters are the faculties of dexterity, speed and good judgement exhibited by the players, for it is in deploying these faculties effectively that any player is deemed to have played well. (See also Discourses 4.7.5/19/30–1.) Epictetus also uses the metaphor of playing games when discussing suicide, for just as someone stops playing a game when they are no longer amused by it, so it should be in life generally: if life should become unbearable, no one can force us to keep living it.

To summarize: remember that the door is open. Do not be more cowardly than children, but just as they say, when the game no longer pleases them, 'I will play no more,' you too, when things seem that way to you, should merely say, 'I will play no more,' and so depart; but if you stay, stop moaning. (Discourses 1.24.20, trans. Hard; see also 1.25.7–21 and 2.16.37)

 

Life as weaving

. In this metaphor, the wool that the weaver uses to make cloth takes the place of the ball in the game; that is, whatever material comes our way, it is our duty to make proper use of it, and if possible make it into the best thing of its kind as we can (see Discourses 2.5.21–2).

Life as a play

. We have already seen, when discussing the Discipline of Action, that Epictetus urges us to 'remember who we are' and what 'name' we have, because what role we play in life will determine which actions are appropriate for us. Obviously, the metaphor of life as a play expands on this idea, but also brings in the notion of our having to accept our fate, whatever that may be, since we do not ourselves chose the role we must play (for although we may aim for one role rather than another, we must recognise that our attaining it is not, in fact, 'in our power').

Remember that you are an actor in a play, which is as the author [i.e., God] wants it to be: short, if he wants it to be short; long, if he wants it to be long. If he wants you to act a poor man, a cripple, a public official, or a private person, see that you act it with skill. For it is your job to act well the part that is assigned to you; but to choose it is another's. (Handbook 17, trans. Hard)

 

Life as an athletic contest

. This metaphor invites us to see an analogy between one's training in Stoic ethics as preparatory for living the philosophic life and someone's training in athletics as preparatory for entering the contest in the arena. Epictetus addresses someone who has become distressed at not having enough leisure to study their philosophy books, saying:

For is not reading a kind of preparation for living, but living itself made up of things other than books? It is as if an athlete, when he enters the stadium, should break down and weep because he is not exercising outside. This is what you were exercising for; this is what the jumping-weights, and the sand and your young partners were all for. So are you now seeking for these, when it is the time for action? That is just as if, in the sphere of assent, when we are presented with impressions, some of which are evidently true and others not, instead of distinguishing between them, we should want to read a treatise On Direct Apprehension. (Discourses 4.4.11–13, trans. Hard)

Training to live a life that befits someone who strives for the Stoic ideal is directly compared to athletic training. Such training is difficult, demanding, and unpleasant; there is little point in showing eagerness for any endeavour if we have not properly assessed the demands that will be placed upon us, and in inevitably losing our original enthusiasm we will look foolish. This applies to philosophic training no less than to training as a wrestler in preparation for competing in the Olympic games (see Discourses 3.15.1–13 = Handbook 29). Elsewhere, Epictetus declares that delay is no longer possible, that we must meet the challenges that life throws at us:

Therefore take the decision right now that you must live as a full-grown man, as a man who is making progress; and all that appears to be best must be to you a law that cannot be transgressed. And if you are confronted with a hard task or with something pleasant, or with something held in high repute or no repute, remember that the contest is now, and that the Olympic games are now, and that it is no longer possible to delay the match, and that progress is lost and saved as a result of one defeat and even one moment of giving in. (Handbook 51.2, trans. Boter; see also Discourses 1.4.13–17, 1.18.21–3, 1.24.1–2 and 3.25.3)

 

Life as military service

. This metaphor returns us to the Stoic idea that the universe is governed by God, and that, like it or not, we are all in service to God. The Stoic prokoptôn (student making progress) should understand that they should live life attempting to discharge this service to the highest standards. Epictetus addresses the person who is upset that they are obliged to travel abroad, causing their mother to be distressed at their absence.

Do you not know that life is a soldier's service? One man must keep guard, another go out to reconnoitre, another take the field. It is not possible for all to stay where they are, nor is it better so. But you neglect to fulfil the orders of the general and complain, when some severe order is laid upon you; you do not understand to what a pitiful state you are bringing the army so far as in you lies; you do not see that if all follow your example there will be no one to dig a trench, or raise a palisade, no one to keep night watch or fight in the field, but every one will seem an unserviceable soldier.
… So too it is in the world; each man's life is a campaign, and a long and varied one. It is for you to play the soldier's part–do everything at the General's bidding, divining his wishes, if it be possible. (Discourses 3.24.31–5, trans. Matheson; see also 1.9.24 and 1.16.20–1)

i. Making Progress

In making progress, the Stoic prokoptôn will pay a price. In standing to God, the world, society, herself and her undertakings in this new way (by accepting the Stoic notions of what is truly good, what is truly up to her, where her proper duties lie, and in considering her life to be one of service to God), the prokoptôn separates herself from the rest of society in fairly marked, if not profound, ways. For example, Epictetus wants his students to enjoy and participate in the 'festival of life', yet at the public games (for instance) they must not support any one individual, but must wish the winner to be he who actually wins; they must refrain entirely from shouting or laughing, and must not get carried away by the spectacle of the contest (Handbook 33.10). So whilst the prokoptôn's friends immerse themselves fully in the games, cheering on their man and jeering at his opponent, the Stoic stands aloof and detached. Deliberately separating herself from the crowd is the price she pays for well-being (eudaimonia), dispassion (apatheia), tranquillity and imperturbability (ataraxia), along with the conviction that she is living as God intends.

But having declared her hand, the prokoptôn will pay in other ways also, for those around her will rebuke and ridicule her (Handbook 22), for in abandoning the values and practices common to the wider community, she will provoke hostility and suspicion. Yet there remains the hope that some at least will see the prokoptôn as someone whose wisdom has value for the community at large, as someone who serves as an example of how one may get along in the world without being overwhelmed by it, as someone with specific skills to offer, such as mediating family disputes and suchlike (see Discourses 1.15.5).

Epictetus characterises the differences between the non-philosopher and someone making progress in these terms:

This is the position and character of a layman: He never looks for either help or harm from himself, but only from externals. This is the position and character of the philosopher: He looks for all his help or harm from himself.
Signs of one who is making progress are: He censures no one, praises no one, blames no one, finds fault with no one, says nothing about himself as though he were somebody or knew something. When he is hampered or prevented, he blames himself. And if anyone compliments him, he smiles to himself at the person complimenting; while if anyone censures him, he makes no defence. He goes about like an invalid, being careful not to disturb, before it has grown firm, any part which is getting well. He has put away from himself every desire, and has transferred his aversion to those things only, of what is under our control [eph' hêmin], which are contrary to nature. He exercises no pronounced choice in regard to anything. If he gives the appearance of being foolish or ignorant he does not care. In a word, he keeps guard against himself as though he were his own enemy lying in wait. (Handbook 48.1–3, trans. Oldfather)

Epictetus' life as a Stoic teacher can perhaps be regarded as a personal quest to awaken to true philosophic enlightenment that person who will stand up proudly when his teacher pleads:

Pray, let somebody show me a person who is in such a good way that he can say, 'I concern myself only with what is my own, with what is free from hindrance, and is by nature free. That is what is truly good, and this I have. But let all else be as god may grant; it makes no difference to me.' (Discourses 4.13.24, trans. Hard)

For having attained such enlightenment himself (for surely this we must suppose), Epictetus devoted his life to raising up others from the crowd of humanity who could stand beside him and share in a perception of the universe and a way of life that any rational being is obliged to adopt in virtue of the nature of things.

5. Glossary of Terms

adiaphora 'indifferent'; any of those things that are neither good or bad, everything, in fact, that does not fall under the headings 'virtue' or 'vice'. The indifferents are what those lacking Stoic wisdom frequently take to have value (either positive or negative), and hence take to be desirable or undesirable. Pursuing them, or trying to avoid them, can lead to disturbing emotions that undermine one's capacity to lead a eudaimôn life.

 

apatheia

freedom from passion, a constituent of the eudaimôn life.

aphormê

aversion; the opposite of hormê.

apoproêgmena

any 'dispreferred' indifferent, including such things as sickness, poverty, social exclusion, and so forth (conventionally 'bad' things). Suffering any of the dispreferred indifferents does not detract from the eudaimôn life enjoyed by the Stoic sophos. See proêgmena.

appropriate action

see kathêkon.

aretê

'excellence' or virtue; in the context of Stoic ethics the possession of 'moral excellence' will secure eudaimonia. For Epictetus, one acquires this by learning the correct use of impressions, following God, and following nature.

askesis

training or exercise undertaken by the Stoic prokoptôn striving to become a Stoic sophos.

assent

see sunkatathesis and phantasiai (impressions).

ataraxia

imperturbability, literally 'without trouble', sometimes translated as 'tranquillity'; a state of mind that is a constituent of the eudaimôn life.

duty

see kathêkon.

ekklisis

avoidance; opposite of orexis.

ektos

'external'; any of those things that fall outside the preserve of one's prohairesis, including health, wealth, sickness, life, death, pain – what Epictetus calls aprohaireta, which are not in our power, the 'indifferent' things.

emotion

see pathos.

end

see telos.

eph' hêmin

what is in our power, or 'up to us' – namely, the correct use of impressions.

eudaimonia

'happiness' or 'flourishing' or 'living well'. One achieves this end by learning the correct use of impressions following God, and following nature.

eupatheiai

'good feelings', possessed by the Stoic wise person (sophos) who experiences these special sorts of emotions, but does not experience irrational and disturbing passions.

excellence

see aretê.

external thing

see ektos.

God

see theos.

hêgemonikon

'commanding faculty' of the soul (psuchê); the centre of consciousness, the seat of all mental states, thought by the Stoics (and other ancients) to be located in the heart. It manifests four mental powers: the capacity to receive impressions, to assent to them, form intentions to act in response to them, and to do these things rationally. The Discourses talk of keeping the prohairesis in the right condition, and also of keeping the hêgemonikon in the right condition, and for Epictetus these notions are essentially interchangeable.

hormê

impulse to act; that which motivates an action.

impressions

see phantasiai.

indifferents

see adiaphora.

kathêkon

any 'appropriate action', 'proper function', or 'duty' undertaken by someone aiming to do what befits them as a responsible, sociable person. The appropriate actions are the subject of the second of the three topoi.

katorthôma

a 'right action' or 'perfect action' undertaken by the Stoic sophos, constituted by an appropriate action performed virtuously.

orexis

'desire' properly directed only at virtue.

passion

see pathos.

pathos

any of the disturbing emotions or 'passions' experienced by those who lack Stoic wisdom and believe that externals really are good or bad, when in fact they are 'indifferent'. A pathos according to the Stoics is a false judgement based on a misunderstanding of what is truly good and bad.

phantasiai

'impressions', what we are aware of in virtue of having experiences. Whereas non-rational animals respond to their impressions automatically (thus 'using' them), over and above using our impressions, human beings, being rational, can 'attend to their use' and, with practice, assent or not assent to them as we deem appropriate. The capacity to do this is what Epictetus strives to teach his students.

phusis

nature. To acquire eudaimonia one must 'follow nature', which means accepting our own fate and the fate of the world, as well as understanding what it means to be a rational being and strive for virtue. See aretê and God.

proêgmena

any 'preferred' indifferent, conventionally taken to be good, including such things as health and wealth, taking pleasure in the company of others, and so forth. Enjoying any of the preferred indifferents is not in itself constitutive of the eudaimôn life sought by the Stoic prokoptôn. See apoproêgmena.

prohairesis

'moral character', the capacity that rational beings have for making choices and intending the outcomes of their actions, sometimes translated as will, volition, intention, choice, moral choice, moral purpose. This faculty is understood by Stoics to be essentially rational. It is the faculty we use to 'attend to impressions' and to give (or withhold) assent to impressions.

prokoptôn

one who is making progress (prokopê) in living as a Stoic, which for Epictetus means above all learning the correct use of impressions.

proper function

see kathêkon.

right action

see katorthôma.

sophos

the Stoic wise person who values only aretê and enjoys a eudaimôn life. The sophos enjoys a way of engaging in life that the prokoptôn strives to emulate and attain.

sunkatathesis

assent; a capacity of the prohairesis to judge the significance of impressions.

tarachê

disturbance, trouble; what one avoids when one enjoys ataraxia.

telos

end; that which we should pursue for its own sake and not for the sake of any other thing. For the Stoic, this is virtue. Epictetus formulates the end in several different but closely related ways. He says that the end is to maintain one's prohairesis in proper order, to follow God, and to follow nature, all of which count as maintaining a eudaimôn life. The means by which this is to be accomplished is to apply oneself to the 'three disciplines' assiduously.

theos

God, who is material, is a sort of fiery breath that blends with undifferentiated matter to create the forms that we find in the world around us. He is supremely rational, and despite our feelings to the contrary, makes the best world that it is possible to make. Epictetus says that we should 'follow God', that is, accept the fate that He bestows on us and on the world. Stoics understand that the rationality enjoyed by every human being (and any other rational beings, should there be any) is literally a fragment of God.

topoi

'topics'. The 'three topics' or 'fields of study' which we find elucidated in the Discourses is an original feature of Epictetus' educational programme. The three fields of study are: (1) The Discipline of Desire, concerned with desire and avoidance (orexis and ekklisis), and what is really good and desirable (virtue, using impressions properly, following God, and following nature); (2) The Discipline of Action, concerned with impulse and aversion (hormê and aphormê), and our 'appropriate actions' or 'duties' with respect to living in our communities in ways that befit a rational being; and (3) The Discipline of Assent, concerned with how we should judge our impressions so as not to be carried away by them into anxiety or disturbing emotions with the likelihood of failing in the first two Disciplines.

virtue

from the Latin virtus which translates the Greek aretê, 'excellence'.

Zeus

the name for God; Epictetus uses the terms 'Zeus', 'God', and 'the gods' interchangeably.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Translations of Epictetus

(Note: 'Enchiridion', 'Encheiridion', 'Handbook', and 'Manual' all refer to the same work. Items in print and currently available are indicated with an asterisk*.)

  • *Boter, Gerard. 1999. The Encheiridion of Epictetus & its Three Christian Adaptations: Transmission & Critical Editions. Leiden: Brill.
  • *Dobbin, Robert. 1998. Epictetus: Discourses Book 1. Oxford: Clarendon.
    • Includes commentary.
  • *Hard, Robin. 1995. The Discourses of Epictetus. ed. with introduction and notes by Christopher Gill. London: Everyman/Dent.
    • Includes the complete Discourses, The Handbook, and Fragments.
  • Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1890. The Works of Epictetus Consisting of His Discourses, in Four Books, The Enchiridion, and Fragments. Boston: Little, Brown, & Company.
  • Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1944. Epictetus: Discourses and Enchiridion. Roslyn, NY: Walter J. Black.
    • Reprint of the nineteenth-century translation with minor editorial alterations.
  • *Higginson, Thomas Wentworth. 1948. The Enchiridion. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall.
    • Reprint of nineteenth-century translation.
  • *Lobell, Sharon. 1995. Epictetus: The Art of Living. The Classic Manual on Virtue, Happiness, and Effectiveness: A New Interpretation. San Francisco: HarperSanFrancisco.
    • A free paraphrase of the Handbook.
  • Long, George. 1890. The Discourses of Epictetus with the Encheiridion and Fragments. London: George Bell.
    • First published 1848.
  • *Long, George. 1991. Enchiridion. Amherst, NY: Prometheus.
    • Reprint of nineteenth-century translation.
  • Matheson, P. E. 1916. Epictetus: The Discourses and Manual. 2 vols. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • *Matson, Wallace I. 1998. Epictetus: Encheiridion. in Louis P. Pojman. ed. Classics of Philosophy: Volume 1, Ancient and Medieval. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • *Oldfather, W. A. 1925, 1928. Epictetus: The Discourses as Reported by Arrian, The Manual, and Fragments. 2 vols. Cambridge, MA: Loeb Classical Library, Harvard University Press.
    • With original Greek text facing English translation.
  • *Saunders, Jason L. ed. 1996. Greek and Roman Philosophy after Aristotle. New York: Free Press.
    • Readings from Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, Philo, Plotinus, and early Christian thought. Includes P. E. Matheson's translation of the Manual of Epictetus.
  • *White, Nicholas. 1983. Handbook of Epictetus. Indianapolis: Hackett.
    • A very competent and readable translation, with notes and a helpful, clear introduction.

b. Translations of Hellenistic Philosophers, including the Stoics

  • Inwood, Brad and L. P. Gerson. 1997. Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings. 2nd edition. Indianapolis: Hackett.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism and Scepticism.
  • Long, A. A. and D. N. Sedley. 1987. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Readings from the main schools: Epicureanism, Stoicism, Scepticism, and the Academics. Includes commentaries on the readings. This is the standard primary source text. Volume 2 contains the original Greek and Latin.

c. Items that Address Epictetus Specifically

  • Bonhöffer, Adolf Friedrich. 1996. The Ethics of the Stoic Epictetus. trans. William O. Stephens. New York: Peter Lang.
    • A very nicely done translation of this significant nineteenth-century work first published in 1894.
  • Hijmans, B. L. 1959. Askesis: Notes on Epictetus' Educational System. Assen: Van Gorcum.
  • Long, A. A. 2002. Epictetus: A Stoic and Socratic Guide to Life. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stephens, William O. 1996. Epictetus on How the Stoic Sage Loves. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 14: 193–210.
    • A very clear, scholarly survey of Epictetus' ethics.
  • Stockdale, James Bond. 1993. Courage Under Fire: Testing Epictetus's Doctrines in a Laboratory of Human Behavior. Stanford: Hoover Institution/Stanford University.
    • An account of how the author used the principles of Stoic ethics to survive the rigors of a Vietnamese prisoner of war camp.
  • Xenakis, Jason. 1969. Epictetus: Philosopher–Therapist. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

d. Items Addressing Stoic Philosophy and/or Hellenistic Ethics Generally

  • Annas, Julia. 1995. The Morality of Happiness. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Gould, Josiah B. 1970. The Philosophy of Chrysippus. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Hadot, Pierre. 1995. Philosophy as a Way of Life. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Engaging essays on the notion of philosophy as a way of life, with focus on Stoic practice.
  • Hadot, Pierre. 1998. The Inner Citadel: The Mediations of Marcus Aurelius. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Contains a very helpful chapter on Epictetus.
  • Inwood, Brad. 1985. Ethics and Human Action in Early Stoicism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lesses, Glen. 1989. Virtue and the Goods of Fortune in Stoic Moral Theory. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 7: 95–127.
  • Lesses, Glen. 1993. Austere Friends: The Stoics and Friendship. Apeiron 26: 57–75.
  • Long, A. A. 1986. Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans, Sceptics. 2nd ed. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • More, Paul Elmer. 1923. Hellenistic Philosophies. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. 1994. The Therapy of Desire: Theory and Practice in Hellenistic Ethics. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • Contains very helpful chapters on Stoic ethics from the view point of philosophy as therapy, as the ancients conceived it.
  • Reale, Giovanni. 1990. A History of Ancient Philosophy: 4. The Schools of the Imperial Age. ed. & trans. John R. Catan. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Sandbach, F. H. 1989. The Stoics. London: Duckworth and Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Sharples, R. W. 1996. Stoics, Epicureans, and Sceptics: An Introduction to Hellenistic Philosophy. London: Routledge.
  • Striker, Gisela. 1990. Ataraxia: Happiness as Tranquillity. The Monist 73–1: 97–110. also in Striker 1996
  • Striker, Gisela. 1991. Following Nature: A Study in Stoic Ethics. Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 9: 1–73. also in Striker 1996.
  • Striker, Gisela. 1996. Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

e. Other items on Hellenistic philosophy generally

  • Algra, Keimpe, et al. eds. 1999. The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Annas, Julia. 1992. Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.

Author Information

Keith H. Seddon
Email: k.h.s@btinternet.com
Warnborough College
Ireland

Epicurus (341—271 B.C.E.)

epicurus2Epicurus is one of the major philosophers in the Hellenistic period, the three centuries following the death of Alexander the Great in 323 B.C.E. (and of Aristotle in 322 B.C.E.). Epicurus developed an unsparingly materialistic metaphysics, empiricist epistemology, and hedonistic ethics. Epicurus taught that the basic constituents of the world are atoms, uncuttable bits of matter, flying through empty space, and he tried to explain all natural phenomena in atomic terms. Epicurus rejected the existence of Platonic forms and an immaterial soul, and he said that the gods have no influence on our lives. Epicurus also thought skepticism was untenable, and that we could gain knowledge of the world relying upon the senses. He taught that the point of all one's actions was to attain pleasure (conceived of as tranquility) for oneself, and that this could be done by limiting one's desires and by banishing the fear of the gods and of death. Epicurus' gospel of freedom from fear proved to be quite popular, and communities of Epicureans flourished for centuries after his death.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Sources
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Arguments for the Existence of Atoms and Void
    2. Properties of Atoms, Limitlessness of the Universe
    3. Differences from Democritus
      1. Weight
      2. The Swerve
      3. Sensible Qualities
    4. Mechanistic Explanations of Natural Phenomena
    5. The Gods
    6. Philosophy of Mind
    7. Perception
  4. Epistemology
    1. The Canon: Sensations, Preconceptions, and Feelings
    2. Anti-skeptical Arguments
      1. The "Lazy Argument"
      2. The Self-refutation Argument
      3. The Argument from Concept-formation
  5. Ethics
    1. Hedonism, Psychological and Ethical
    2. Types of Pleasure
    3. Types of Desire
    4. The Virtues
    5. Justice
    6. Friendship
    7. Death
      1. The No Subject of Harm Argument
      2. The Symmetry Argument
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Collections of Primary Sources
    2. Recent Books on Particular Areas of Epicurus' Philosophy

1. Life

Epicurus was born around 341 B.C.E., seven years after Plato's death, and grew up in the Athenian colony of Samos, an island in the Mediterranean Sea. He was about 19 when Aristotle died, and he studied philosophy under followers of Democritus and Plato. Epicurus founded his first philosophical schools in Mytilene and Lampsacus, before moving to Athens around 306 B.C.E. There Epicurus founded the Garden, a combination of philosophical community and school. The residents of the Garden put Epicurus' teachings into practice. Epicurus died from kidney stones around 271 or 270 B.C.E.

After Epicurus' death, Epicureanism continued to flourish as a philosophical movement. Communities of Epicureans sprang up throughout the Hellenistic world; along with Stoicism, it was one of the major philosophical schools competing for people's allegiances. Epicureanism went into decline with the rise of Christianity. Certain aspects of Epicurus' thought were revived during the Renaissance and early modern periods, when reaction against scholastic neo-Aristotelianism led thinkers to turn to mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena.

2. Sources

Epicurus was a voluminous writer, but almost none of his own work survives. A likely reason for this is that Christian authorities found his ideas ungodly. Diogenes Laertius, who probably lived in the third century CE , wrote a 10-book Lives of the Philosophers, which includes three of Epicurus' letters in its recounting of the life and teachings of Epicurus. These three letters are brief summaries of major areas of Epicurus' philosophy: the Letter to Herodotus, which summarizes his metaphysics, the Letter to Pythocles, which gives atomic explanations for meteorological phenomena, and the Letter to Menoeceus, which summarizes his ethics. It also includes the Principal Doctrines, 40 sayings which deal mainly with ethical matters.

Because of the absence of Epicurus' own writings, we have to rely on later writers to reconstruct Epicurus' thought. Two of our most important sources are the Roman poet Lucretius (c. 94-55 B.C.E.) and the Roman politician Cicero (106-43 B.C.E.). Lucretius was an Epicurean who wrote De Rerum Natura (On the Nature of Things), a six-book poem expounding Epicurus' metaphysics. Cicero was an adherent of the skeptical academy, who wrote a series of works setting forth the major philosophical systems of his day, including Epicureanism. Another major source is the essayist Plutarch (c. 50-120 CE), a Platonist. However, both Cicero and Plutarch were very hostile toward Epicureanism, so they must be used with care, since they often are less than charitable toward Epicurus, and may skew his views to serve their own purposes.

Although the major outlines of Epicurus' thought are clear enough, the lack of sources means many of the details of his philosophy are still open to dispute.

3. Metaphysics

Epicurus believes that the basic constituents of the world are atoms (which are uncuttable, microscopic bits of matter) moving in the void (which is simply empty space). Ordinary objects are conglomerations of atoms. Furthermore, the properties of macroscopic bodies and all of the events we see occurring can be explained in terms of the collisions, reboundings, and entanglements of atoms.

a. Arguments for the Existence of Atoms and Void

Epicurus' metaphysics starts from two simple points: (1) we see that there are bodies in motion, and (2) nothing comes into existence from what does not exist. Epicurus takes the first point to be simply a datum of experience. The second point is a commonplace of ancient Greek philosophy, derived from the Principle of Sufficient Reason (the principle that for everything which occurs there is a reason or explanation for why it occurs, and why this way rather than that).

First, because bodies move, there must be empty space for them to move in, and Epicurus calls this empty space 'void.' Second, the ordinary bodies that we see are compound bodies--that is, bodies which are made up of further bodies, which is shown by the fact that they can be broken down into smaller pieces. However, Epicurus thinks that this process of division cannot go on indefinitely, because otherwise bodies would dissolve away into nothing. Also, there must be basic and unchangeable building blocks of matter in order to explain the regularities in nature. These non-compound bodies are atoms--literally, 'uncuttables.' Only bodies and void exist per se, that is, exist without depending for their existence on something else. Other things--such as colors, time, and justice--are ultimately explicable as attributes of bodies.

b. Properties of Atoms, Limitlessness of the Universe

Because Epicurus believes that nothing comes into existence from nothing, he thinks that the universe has no beginning, but has always existed, and will always exist. Atoms, too, as the basic building blocks of all else, cannot come into existence, but have always existed. Our particular cosmos, however, is only a temporary agglomeration of atoms, and it is only one of an infinite number of such cosmoi, which come into existence and then dissolve away. Against Aristotle, Epicurus argues that the universe is unlimited in size. If the universe were limited in size, says Epicurus, you could go to the end of it, stick your fist out, and where your fist was located would be the new 'limit' of the universe. Of course, this process could be reiterated an endless number of times. Since the universe is unlimited in size, there must also be an unlimited number of atoms and an infinite amount of void. If the number of atoms were limited, then the 'density' of atoms in any region would effectively be zero, and there would be no macroscopic bodies, as there evidently are. And there must be an unlimited amount of void, since without a limitless amount of void, the infinite number of atoms would be unable to move.

c. Differences from Democritus

Up to this point, Epicurus is largely following the thought of Democritus, a pre-Socratic philosopher and one of the inventors of atomism. However, he modifies Democritus' atomism in at least three important ways.

i. Weight

The first is that Epicurus thinks that atoms have weight. Like Democritus, Epicurus believes that atoms have the properties of size, shape, and resistance. Democritus explains all atomic motion as the result of previous atomic collisions, plus the inertia of atoms. Aristotle, however, criticizes Democritus on this point, saying that Democritus has not explained why it is that atoms move at all, rather than simply standing still. Epicurus seems to be answering this criticism when he says that atoms do have a natural motion of direction--'downward'--even though there is no bottom to the universe. This natural motion is supposed to give an explanation for why atoms move in the first place. Also, Epicurus thinks that it is evident that bodies do tend to travel down, all else being equal, and he thinks that positing weight as an atomic property accounts for this better than thinking all atomic motion is the result of past collisions and inertia.

ii. The Swerve

The second modification of Democritus' views is the addition of the 'swerve.' In addition to the regular tendency of atoms to move downward, Epicurus thinks that occasionally, and at random times, the atoms swerve to the side. One reason for this swerve is that it is needed to explain why there are atomic collisions. The natural tendency of atoms is to fall straight downward, at uniform velocity. If this were the only natural atomic motion, the atoms never would have collided with one another, forming macroscopic bodies. As Lucretius puts it, they would 'fall downward, like drops of rain, through the deep void.' The second reason for thinking that atoms swerve is that a random atomic motion is needed to preserve human freedom and 'break the bonds of fate,' as Lucretius says. If the laws of atomic motion are deterministic, then the past positions of the atoms in the universe, plus these laws, determine everything that will occur, including human action. Cicero reports that Epicurus worries that, if it has been true from eternity that, e.g., "Milo will wrestle tomorrow," then presently deliberating about whether to make it true or false would be idle.

iii. Sensible Qualities

The third difference between Epicurus and Democritus has to do with their attitudes toward the reality of sensible properties. Democritus thinks that, in reality, only atoms and the void exist, and that sensible qualities such as sweetness, whiteness, and the like exist only 'by convention.' It is controversial exactly how to understand Democritus' position, but most likely he is asserting that atoms themselves have no sensible qualities--they are simply extended bits of stuff. The sensible qualities that we think bodies have, like sweetness, are not really in the object at all, but are simply subjective states of the percipient's awareness produced by the interaction of bodies with our sense-organs. This is shown, thinks Democritus, by the fact that the same body appears differently to different percipients depending on their bodily constitution, e.g., that a 'white' body appears yellow to somebody with jaundice, or that honey tastes bitter to an ill person. From this, Democritus derives skeptical conclusions. He is pessimistic about our ability to gain any knowledge about the world on the basis of our senses, since they systematically deceive us about the way the world is.

Epicurus wants to resist these pessimistic conclusions. He argues that properties like sweetness, whiteness, and such do not exist at the atomic level--individual atoms are not sweet or white--but that these properties are nonetheless real. These are properties of macroscopic bodies, but the possession of these properties by macroscopic bodies are explicable in terms of the properties of and relations amongst the individual atoms that make up bodies. Epicurus thinks that bodies have the capability to cause us to have certain types of experiences because of their atomic structure, and that such capabilities are real properties of the bodies. Similar considerations apply for properties like "being healthy," "being deadly," and "being enslaved." They are real, but can only apply to groups of atoms (like people), not individual atoms. And these sorts of properties are also relational properties, not intrinsic ones. For example, cyanide is deadly--not deadly per se, but deadly for human beings (and perhaps for other types of organisms). Nonetheless, its deadliness for us is still a real property of the cyanide, albeit a relational one.

d. Mechanistic Explanations of Natural Phenomena

One important aspect of Epicurus' philosophy is his desire to replace teleological (goal-based) explanations of natural phenomena with mechanistic ones. His main target is mythological explanations of meteorological occurrences and the like in terms of the will of the gods. Because Epicurus wishes to banish the fear of the gods, he insists that occurrences like earthquakes and lightning can be explained entirely in atomic terms and are not due to the will of the gods. Epicurus is also against the intrinsic teleology of philosophers like Aristotle. Teeth appear to be well-designed for the purpose of chewing. Aristotle thinks that this apparent purposiveness in nature cannot be eliminated, and that the functioning of the parts of organisms must be explained by appealing to how they contribute to the functioning of the organism as a whole. Other philosophers, such as the Stoics, took this apparent design as evidence for the intelligence and benevolence of God. Epicurus, however, following Empedocles, tries to explain away this apparent purposiveness in nature in a proto-Darwinian way, as the result of a process of natural selection.

e. The Gods

Because of its denial of divine providence, Epicureanism was often charged in antiquity with being a godless philosophy, although Epicurus and his followers denied the charge. The main upshot of Epicurean theology is certainly negative, however. Epicurus' mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena are supposed to displace explanations that appeal to the will of the gods. In addition, Epicurus is one of the earliest philosophers we know of to have raised the Problem of Evil, arguing against the notion that the world is under the providential care of a loving deity by pointing out the manifold suffering in the world.

Despite this, Epicurus says that there are gods, but these gods are quite different from the popular conception of gods. We have a conception of the gods, says Epicurus, as supremely blessed and happy beings. Troubling oneself about the miseries of the world, or trying to administer the world, would be inconsistent with a life of tranquility, says Epicurus, so the gods have no concern for us. In fact, they are unaware of our existence, and live eternally in the intermundia, the space between the cosmoi. For Epicurus, the gods function mainly as ethical ideals, whose lives we can strive to emulate, but whose wrath we need not fear.

Ancient critics thought the Epicurean gods were a thin smoke-screen to hide Epicurus' atheism, and difficulties with a literal interpretation of Epicurus' sayings on the nature of the gods (for instance, it appears inconsistent with Epicurus' atomic theory to hold that any compound body, even a god, could be immortal) have led some scholars to conjecture that Epicurus' 'gods' are thought-constructs, and exist only in human minds as idealizations, i.e., the gods exist, but only as projections of what the most blessed life would be.

f. Philosophy of Mind

Epicurus is one of the first philosophers to put forward an Identity Theory of Mind. In modern versions of the identity theory, the mind is identified with the brain, and mental processes are identified with neural processes. Epicurus' physiology is quite different; the mind is identified as an organ that resides in the chest, since the common Greek view was that the chest, not the head, is the seat of the emotions. However, the underlying idea is quite similar. (Note: not all commentators accept that Epicurus' theory is actually an Identity Theory.)

The main point that Epicurus wants to establish is that the mind is something bodily. The mind must be a body, thinks Epicurus, because of its ability to interact with the body. The mind is affected by the body, as vision, drunkenness, and disease show. Likewise, the mind affects the body, as our ability to move our limbs when we want to and the physiological effects of emotional states show. Only bodies can interact with other bodies, so the mind must be a body. Epicurus says that the mind cannot be something incorporeal, as Plato thinks, since the only thing that is not a body is void, which is simply empty space and cannot act or be acted upon.

The mind, then, is an organ in the body, and mental processes are identified with atomic processes. The mind is composed of four different types of particles--fire, air, wind, and the "nameless element," which surpasses the other particles in its fineness. Although Epicurus is reticent about the details, some features of the mind are accounted for in terms of the features of these atoms--for instance, the mind is able to be moved a great deal by the impact of an image (which is something quite flimsy), because of the smallness of the particles that make up the mind. The mind proper, which is primarily responsible for sensation and thought, is located in the chest, but Epicurus thinks that there is also a 'spirit,' spread throughout the rest of the body, which allows the mind to communicate with it. The mind and spirit play roles very similar to those of the central and peripheral nervous systems in modern theory.

One important result of Epicurus' philosophy of mind is that death is annihilation. The mind is able to engage in the motions of sensation and thought only when it is housed in the body and the atoms that make it up are properly arranged. Upon death, says Epicurus, the container of the body shatters, and the atoms disperse in the air. The atoms are eternal, but the mind made up of these atoms is not, just as other compound bodies cease to exist when the atoms that make them up disperse.

g. Perception

Epicurus explains perception in terms of the interaction of atoms with the sense-organs. Objects continually throw off one-atom-thick layers, like the skin peeling off of an onion. These images, or "eidola," fly through the air and bang into one's eyes, from which one learns about the properties of the objects that threw off these eidola. This explains vision. Other senses are analyzed in similar terms; e.g., the soothing action of smooth atoms on the tongue causes the sensation of sweetness. As noted above, Epicurus maintains that such sensible qualities are real qualities of bodies.

4. Epistemology

Epicurus' epistemology is resolutely empiricist and anti-skeptical. All of our knowledge ultimately comes from the senses, thinks Epicurus, and we can trust the senses, when properly used. Epicurus' epistemology was contained in his work the 'Canon,' or 'measuring stick,' which is lost, so many of the details of his views are unavailable to us. 4a. The Canon: sensations, preconceptions, and feelings

Epicurus says that there are three criteria of truth: sensations, 'preconceptions,' and feelings. Sensations give us information about the external world, and we can test the judgments based upon sensations against further sensations; e.g., a provisional judgment that a tower is round, based upon sensation, can be tested against later sensations to be corroborated or disproved. Epicurus says that all sensations give us information about the world, but that sensation itself is never in error, since sensation is a purely passive, mechanical reception of images and the like by sense-organs, and the senses themselves do not make judgments 'that' the world is this way or that. Instead, error enters in when we make judgments about the world based upon the information received through the senses.

Epicurus thinks that, in order to make judgments about the world, or even to start any inquiry whatsoever, we must already be in possession of certain basic concepts, which stand in need of no further proof or definition, on pain of entering into an infinite regress. This concern is similar to the Paradox of Inquiry explored by Plato in the Meno, that one must already know about something in order to be able to inquire about it. However, instead of postulating that our immaterial souls had acquaintance with transcendent Forms in a pre-natal existence, as Plato does, Epicurus thinks that we have certain 'preconceptions'--concepts such as 'body,' 'person,' 'usefulness,' and 'truth'--which are formed in our (material) minds as the result of repeated sense-experiences of similar objects. Further ideas are formed by processes of analogy or similarity or by compounding these basic concepts. Thus, all ideas are ultimately formed on the basis of sense-experience.

Feelings of pleasure and pain form the basic criteria for what is to be sought and avoided.

b. Anti-skeptical Arguments

Epicurus is concerned to refute the skeptical tendencies of Democritus, whose metaphysics and theory of perception were similar to Epicurus'. At least three separate anti-skeptical arguments are given by Epicureans:

i. The "Lazy Argument"

Epicurus says that it is impossible to live as a skeptic. If a person really were to believe that he knows nothing, then he would have no reason to engage in one course of action instead of another. Thus, the consistent skeptic would engage in no action whatsoever, and would die.

ii. The Self-refutation Argument

If a skeptic claims that nothing can be known, then one should ask whether he knows that nothing can be known. If he says 'yes,' then he is contradicting himself. If he doesn't say yes, then he isn't making a claim, and we don't need to listen to him.

iii. The Argument from Concept-formation

If the skeptic says that nothing can be known, or that we cannot know the truth, we can ask him where he gets his knowledge of concepts such as 'knowledge' and 'truth.' If the senses cannot be relied on, as the skeptic claims, then he is not entitled to use concepts such as 'knowledge' and 'truth' in formulating his thesis, since such concepts derive from the senses.

5. Ethics

Epicurus' ethics is a form of egoistic hedonism; i.e., he says that the only thing that is intrinsically valuable is one's own pleasure; anything else that has value is valuable merely as a means to securing pleasure for oneself. However, Epicurus has a sophisticated and idiosyncratic view of the nature of pleasure, which leads him to recommend a virtuous, moderately ascetic life as the best means to securing pleasure. This contrasts Epicurus strongly with the Cyrenaics, a group of ancient hedonists who better fit the stereotype of hedonists as recommending a policy of "eat, drink, and be merry."

a. Hedonism, Psychological and Ethical

Epicurus' ethics starts from the Aristotelian commonplace that the highest good is what is valued for its own sake, and not for the sake of anything else, and Epicurus agrees with Aristotle that happiness is the highest good. However, he disagrees with Aristotle by identifying happiness with pleasure. Epicurus gives two reasons for this. The main reason is that pleasure is the only thing that people do, as a matter of fact, value for its own sake; that is, Epicurus' ethical hedonism is based upon his psychological hedonism. Everything we do, claims Epicurus, we do for the sake ultimately of gaining pleasure for ourselves. This is supposedly confirmed by observing the behavior of infants, who, it is claimed, instinctively pursue pleasure and shun pain. This is also true of adults, thinks Epicurus, but in adults it is more difficult to see that this is true, since adults have much more complicated beliefs about what will bring them pleasure. But the Epicureans did spend a great deal of energy trying to make plausible the contention that all activity, even apparently self-sacrificing activity or activity done solely for the sake of virtue or what is noble, is in fact directed toward obtaining pleasure for oneself.

The second proof, which fits in well with Epicurus' empiricism, supposedly lies in one's introspective experience. One immediately perceives that pleasure is good and that pain is bad, in the same way that one immediately perceives that fire is hot; no further argument is needed to show the goodness of pleasure or the badness of pain. (Of course, this does not establish Epicurus' further contention that only pleasure is intrinsically valuable and only pain is intrinsically bad.)

Although all pleasures are good and all pains evil, Epicurus says that not all pleasures are choiceworthy or all pains to be avoided. Instead, one should calculate what is in one's long-term self-interest, and forgo what will bring pleasure in the short-term if doing so will ultimately lead to greater pleasure in the long-term.

b. Types of Pleasure

For Epicurus, pleasure is tied closely to satisfying one's desires. He distinguishes between two different types of pleasure: 'moving' pleasures and 'static' pleasures. 'Moving' pleasures occur when one is in the process of satisfying a desire, e.g., eating a hamburger when one is hungry. These pleasures involve an active titillation of the senses, and these feelings are what most people call 'pleasure.' However, Epicurus says that after one's desires have been satisfied, (e.g., when one is full after eating), the state of satiety, of no longer being in need or want, is itself pleasurable. Epicurus calls this a 'static' pleasure, and says that these static pleasures are the best pleasures.

Because of this, Epicurus denies that there is any intermediate state between pleasure and pain. When one has unfulfilled desires, this is painful, and when one no longer has unfulfilled desires, this steady state is the most pleasurable of all, not merely some intermediate state between pleasure and pain.

Epicurus also distinguishes between physical and mental pleasures and pains. Physical pleasures and pains concern only the present, whereas mental pleasures and pains also encompass the past (fond memories of past pleasure or regret over past pain or mistakes) and the future (confidence or fear about what will occur). The greatest destroyer of happiness, thinks Epicurus, is anxiety about the future, especially fear of the gods and fear of death. If one can banish fear about the future, and face the future with confidence that one's desires will be satisfied, then one will attain tranquility (ataraxia), the most exalted state. In fact, given Epicurus' conception of pleasure, it might be less misleading to call him a 'tranquillist' instead of a 'hedonist.'

c. Types of Desire

Because of the close connection of pleasure with desire-satisfaction, Epicurus devotes a considerable part of his ethics to analyzing different kinds of desires. If pleasure results from getting what you want (desire-satisfaction) and pain from not getting what you want (desire-frustration), then there are two strategies you can pursue with respect to any given desire: you can either strive to fulfill the desire, or you can try to eliminate the desire. For the most part Epicurus advocates the second strategy, that of paring your desires down to a minimum core, which are then easily satisfied.

Epicurus distinguishes between three types of desires: natural and necessary desires, natural but non-necessary desires, and "vain and empty" desires. Examples of natural and necessary desires include the desires for food, shelter, and the like. Epicurus thinks that these desires are easy to satisfy, difficult to eliminate (they are 'hard-wired' into human beings naturally), and bring great pleasure when satisfied. Furthermore, they are necessary for life, and they are naturally limited: that is, if one is hungry, it only takes a limited amount of food to fill the stomach, after which the desire is satisfied. Epicurus says that one should try to fulfill these desires.

Vain desires include desires for power, wealth, fame, and the like. They are difficult to satisfy, in part because they have no natural limit. If one desires wealth or power, no matter how much one gets, it is always possible to get more, and the more one gets, the more one wants. These desires are not natural to human beings, but inculcated by society and by false beliefs about what we need; e.g., believing that having power will bring us security from others. Epicurus thinks that these desires should be eliminated.

An example of a natural but non-necessary desire is the desire for luxury food. Although food is needed for survival, one does not need a particular type of food to survive. Thus, despite his hedonism, Epicurus advocates a surprisingly ascetic way of life. Although one shouldn't spurn extravagant foods if they happen to be available, becoming dependent on such goods ultimately leads to unhappiness. As Epicurus puts it, "If you wish to make Pythocles wealthy, don't give him more money; rather, reduce his desires." By eliminating the pain caused by unfulfilled desires, and the anxiety that occurs because of the fear that one's desires will not be fulfilled in the future, the wise Epicurean attains tranquility, and thus happiness.

d. The Virtues

Epicurus' hedonism was widely denounced in the ancient world as undermining traditional morality. Epicurus, however, insists that courage, moderation, and the other virtues are needed in order to attain happiness. However, the virtues for Epicurus are all purely instrumental goods--that is, they are valuable solely for the sake of the happiness that they can bring oneself, not for their own sake. Epicurus says that all of the virtues are ultimately forms of prudence, of calculating what is in one's own best interest. In this, Epicurus goes against the majority of Greek ethical theorists, such as the Stoics, who identify happiness with virtue, and Aristotle, who identifies happiness with a life of virtuous activity. Epicurus thinks that natural science and philosophy itself also are instrumental goods. Natural science is needed in order to give mechanistic explanations of natural phenomena and thus dispel the fear of the gods, while philosophy helps to show us the natural limits of our desires and to dispel the fear of death.

e. Justice

Epicurus is one of the first philosophers to give a well-developed contractarian theory of justice. Epicurus says that justice is an agreement "neither to harm nor be harmed," and that we have a preconception of justice as "what is useful in mutual associations." People enter into communities in order to gain protection from the dangers of the wild, and agreements concerning the behavior of the members of the community are needed in order for these communities to function, e.g., prohibitions of murder, regulations concerning the killing and eating of animals, and so on. Justice exists only where there are such agreements.

Like the virtues, justice is valued entirely on instrumental grounds, because of its utility for each of the members of society. Epicurus says that the main reason not to be unjust is that one will be punished if one gets caught, and that even if one does not get caught, the fear of being caught will still cause pain. However, he adds that the fear of punishment is needed mainly to keep fools in line, who otherwise would kill, steal, etc. The Epicurean wise man recognizes the usefulness of the laws, and since he does not desire great wealth, luxury goods, political power, or the like, he sees that he has no reason to engage in the conduct prohibited by the laws in any case.

Although justice only exists where there is an agreement about how to behave, that does not make justice entirely 'conventional,' if by 'conventional' we mean that any behavior dictated by the laws of a particular society is thereby just, and that the laws of a particular society are just for that society. Since the 'justice contract' is entered into for the purpose of securing what is useful for the members of the society, only laws that are actually useful are just. Thus, a prohibition of murder would be just, but antimiscegenation laws would not. Since what is useful can vary from place to place and time to time, what laws are just can likewise vary.

f. Friendship

Epicurus values friendship highly and praises it in quite extravagant terms. He says that friendship "dances around the world" telling us that we must "wake to blessedness." He also says that the wise man is sometimes willing to die for a friend. Because of this, some scholars have thought that in this area, at least, Epicurus abandons his egoistic hedonism and advocates altruism toward friends. This is not clear, however. Epicurus consistently maintains that friendship is valuable because it is one of the greatest means of attaining pleasure. Friends, he says, are able to provide one another the greatest security, whereas a life without friends is solitary and beset with perils. In order for there to be friendship, Epicurus says, there must be trust between friends, and friends have to treat each other as well as they treat themselves. The communities of Epicureans can be seen as embodying these ideals, and these are ideals that ultimately promote ataraxia.

g. Death

One of the greatest fears that Epicurus tries to combat is the fear of death. Epicurus thinks that this fear is often based upon anxiety about having an unpleasant afterlife; this anxiety, he thinks, should be dispelled once one realizes that death is annihilation, because the mind is a group of atoms that disperses upon death.

i. The No Subject of Harm Argument

If death is annihilation, says Epicurus, then it is 'nothing to us.' Epicurus' main argument for why death is not bad is contained in the Letter to Menoeceus and can be dubbed the 'no subject of harm' argument. If death is bad, for whom is it bad? Not for the living, since they're not dead, and not for the dead, since they don't exist. His argument can be set out as follows:

  1. Death is annihilation.
  2. The living have not yet been annihilated (otherwise they wouldn't be alive).
  3. Death does not affect the living. (from 1 and 2)
  4. So, death is not bad for the living. (from 3)
  5. For something to be bad for somebody, that person has to exist, at least.
  6. The dead do not exist. (from 1)
  7. Therefore, death is not bad for the dead. (from 5 and 6)
  8. Therefore death is bad for neither the living nor the dead. (from 4 and 7)

Epicurus adds that if death causes you no pain when you're dead, it's foolish to allow the fear of it to cause you pain now.

ii. The Symmetry Argument

A second Epicurean argument against the fear of death, the so-called 'symmetry argument,' is recorded by the Epicurean poet Lucretius. He says that anyone who fears death should consider the time before he was born. The past infinity of pre-natal non-existence is like the future infinity of post-mortem non-existence; it is as though nature has put up a mirror to let us see what our future non-existence will be like. But we do not consider not having existed for an eternity before our births to be a terrible thing; therefore, neither should we think not existing for an eternity after our deaths to be evil.

6. References and Further Reading

This is not meant as comprehensive bibliography; rather, it's a selection of further texts to read for those who want to learn more about Epicurus and Epicureanism. Most of the books listed below have extensive bibliographies for those looking for more specialized and scholarly publications.

a. Collections of Primary Source

  • The Epicurus Reader, translated and edited by Brad Inwood and L.P. Gerson, Hackett Publishing.
    • This inexpensive collection has most of the major extant writings of Epicurus, in addition to other ancient sources such as Cicero and Plutarch who wrote about Epicureanism. (Lucretius is not included much.) However, there is little commentary or explication of the material, and some of the primary sources are fairly opaque.
  • The Hellenistic philosophers, Volume 1: translations of the principal sources, with philosophical commentary, by A.A. Long and D.N. Sedley, Cambridge University Press.
    • This excellent book organizes the texts into sections topically, (e.g., "Atoms," "Soul," "Language," "Death,") and follows each selection of texts with commentary and explication. Vol. 2, which contains the original Greek and Latin texts, has a fine, if somewhat dated (1987) bibliography at the end.Lucretius, De Rerum Natura

There are many different editions of Lucretius' masterpiece, an extended exposition of Epicurus' metaphysics, philosophy of mind, and natural science. I personally like the translation by Rolfe Humphries: Lucretius: The Way Things Are. The De Rerum Natura of Titus Lucretius Carus, Indiana University Press. Humphries translates Lucretius' poem as a poem, not as prose, yet the translation is still very clear and readable.

b. Recent Books on Particular Areas of Epicurus' Philosophy

The books below are all well-written and influential. They deal in-depth with problems of interpreting particular areas of Epicurus' philosophy, while still remaining, for the most part, accessible to well-educated general readers. They also have extensive bibliographies. However, do not assume that the interpretations of Epicurus in these books are always widely accepted.

  • Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind, by Julia Annas, University of California Press.
    • This book deals with Epicurean and Stoic theories of what the mind is.
  • Epicurus' Ethical Theory : The Pleasures of Invulnerability, by Phillip Mitsis, Cornell University Press.
    • This book is concerned with all of the major areas of Epicurean ethics, from pleasure, to friendship, justice, and human freedom. Mitsis is especially good at showing how Epicurus' conception of pleasure differs from that of the utilitarians.
  • The Morality of Happiness, by Julia Annas, Oxford University Press.
    • This book focuses deals with all major ancient theorists from Aristotle on, but is still a good source of information on Epicurean ethics, especially if one wants to put Epicurean ethics in the context of other ancient ethical theories.
  • Epicurus' Scientific Method, by Elizabeth Asmis, Cornell University Press.
    • The best book-length treatment of Epicurus' epistemology available. A little more technical than the books above, but still fairly accessible.

Author Information

Tim O'Keefe
Email: see web page
Georgia State University
U. S. A.

Galen (130—200 C.E.)

galen-200x220

Galen was one of the most prominent ancient physicians as well as a philosopher (though most of his philosophical writings are lost). Nonetheless, his philosophical interests are quite evident in his practice of biological science. Galen made some key anatomical observations (though most of these were on other primates).  However, this inclination toward observation moved his theory into the class of critical empiricism.

Galen was also a well-read scholar who combined extensive erudition with ‘cutting edge’ observational practice to completely change the understanding and teaching of medicine. He frequently integrates his observational practice with the natural philosophy of Plato and Aristotle.  His position as the leading authority in medical theory extended for at least fourteen hundred years.

Galen correctly saw that there is a methodological difference between taking account of the patient in front of you in all of the patient’s particularity and, instead, understanding the patient in front of you as representing an instance of a general rule of biomedical science. The way that Galen sought to insert himself into this debate makes his conclusions relevant to medicine today.

 

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Hellenistic Schools of Medicine
  3. Method
  4. Galen's Critical Empiricism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Galen of Pergamum was a physician who was born in Pergamum was a bustling and vibrant city at the time and was particularly famous for its statue of Asclepius, a god of healing. Throughout Galen's life, he avowed a devotion to Asclepius. The city also had a library that almost rivaled Alexandria's in its size. Galen's father, Nicon, was a prosperous architect. This allowed Galen the leisure to get an education and choose a path of life unencumbered by the need to earn money. However, this affluence did not mean that Galen was brought up "soft" (as per Plato's discussion in the Republic 544b-570e in which he discusses the devolution of political systems due to the decay of personal arête). Galen's education was broad and directed by his father. Galen studied in mathematics (a particular favorite of his father), grammar, logic, and philosophy--that included inquiry into the four major schools of the time: the Platonists, the Peripatetics, the Stoics, and the Epicureans. This pluralistic sensibility influenced the philosophical/scientific method of Galen. According to pluralism, one should look at all the prevalent theories and then make up one's own mind choosing either one of the theories or perhaps a new mixture of those presented according to their strengths.

Galen began his study of medicine around the age of sixteen when his father had a dream suggesting this direction. Galen traveled to Smyrna and Corinth to study with both a Rationalist and with an Empiricist. When Galen's father died, Galen traveled to Egypt (Alexandria) where he lived for perhaps five years (152-157). What Galen might have studied in Alexandria is highly speculative. However, Galen, himself, later declares that students should "look at the human skeleton with your own eyes. This is very easy in Alexandria, so that the physicians of that area instruct their pupils with the aid of autopsy" (Kühn II, 220, translation L. Edelstein). This quotation points to the practice of autopsy (dissection of cadavers) in Alexandria. Whether Galen also studied anatomy this way is unclear. It is clear that Galen (at least) engaged in comparative anatomy by dissecting monkeys.

In 157 Galen returned to his hometown to become a surgeon to the gladiators. When civil unrest broke out in 162, Galen left for Rome. The medical community in Rome was competitive and corrupt. In Rome, Galen's ambition got the best of him with the result that his high profile created powerful enemies who caused him to depart secretly in 166. After a couple of years in obscurity, Galen was recalled by the Roman Emperors Marcus Aurelius and Lucius Verus to serve the army in their war against the Germans. When the plague hit Rome, Galen was made personal physician to Marcus Aurelius and Aurelius' son, Commodus. For many years it has been held that Galen remained in Roman society until his death around 199-200 (based upon the Suda Lexicon written around 1000); however, new research by Vivian Nutton has persuasively set the date of Galen's death much later. Nutton proposes that Galen may have lived into his eighties (possibly as old as 87). The source for this new information comes from Byzantine and Arab scholars from the sixth century onwards. On the basis of this, it seems that Galen died around 216, give or take several years, in the reign of Caracalla.

A great many of Galen's works have survived. The Kühn edition of Galen (Greek with a Latin translation) runs over 20,000 pages. There are other Galenic works that only exist in Arabic translations. However, many of Galen's works are lost, e.g., many of his treatises on philosophy (logic, physics, and ethics) perished in a fire that consumed the Temple of Peace in 191.

2. Hellenistic Schools of Medicine

During the end of the fourth century BCE and throughout the third century BCE there were enormous advances in medicine revolving around the principal practitioners: Diocles, Praxagoras, Herophilus, and Erasistratus. During this period the debate about the relative roles of theory and observation were central to these writers (Kühn X, 107). It is, in fact, a perennial question in the philosophy of science. What is at issue is when does one impose a theoretical structure on the world? Part of the answer concerns the origins of the theoretical structure. From whence did it arise? In part, this is a struggle for a logic of induction that might assist the practitioner. Without such a theory of inductive logic, it is unclear whether nature is revealing her nature to the careful observer or whether the observer is imposing his own ideas upon nature. Aristotle discusses some of these issues in Posterior Analytics II.19 and in The Parts of Animals I. However, this is not the end of the question. Some of this tension can be seen in the biomedical writers in the Hippocratic era. However, it is also true that in the construction of scientific theories there must, of necessity, be a tension between those who embrace theoretical structures and those who are skeptical of them. The latter group generally bases their misgivings upon a possible tendency among theorists to create an a priori science. What makes a priori science troublesome is that it breaks contact with the empirical world. It suggests that ratiocination about natural causes is sufficient for the production of scientific theories. For most natural philosophers such a stance is entirely unacceptable. Setting the proper balance between theory and observation was (and continues to me) an important question in the philosophy of science.

One group that added to the debate on the role of observation were the Empiricists. The origins of the Empiricist School might be found in Acron of Akragas, a fifth century BCE follower of Empedocles. This conjecture is based merely upon the testimony of later writers. It could certainly be the case that there was no real medical empiricism, as such, before Serapion, a third century BCE doctor .

Another interesting speculation on the origins of the empiricist physicians comes from Michael Frede. Frede has suggested that from a reference in Plato's Laws 720a-c; 857c-d that there was a two-tired medical system with physicians for the wealthy (who employed theoretical principles) and physicians for the slaves (who relied merely upon trial-and-error experience). If this speculation is correct, then the burden of proof for the empiricists is to show that the theoretical "book learning" of upper class doctors could be reduced to mere experience. In other words, experience, itself, could generate competence. The result would be an elevation of the second-level physician. If Frede is correct on this, then perhaps social situation is partially responsible for the rise of the medical empiricists.

Sextus Empiricus (circa 160-210) set out a loosely woven doctrine of "consideration" or skepsis. Sextus is a key source of our knowledge of Pyrrhonism and is also said to have been a physician (though his writings on medicine have not survived). It is not clear whether Sextus was an original thinker or merely a reflection of his era. However, at the very least, one can garner background information of what might have influenced the empiricists through the doctrine of skepsis. Under this doctrine the theoretical structures of the philosophers (Dogmatists) would be held in abeyance (neither accepted nor rejected). What would rule the day would be the case before the physician right now. The case and the physician's experience would dictate the treatment.

Against the Empiricists, on the other hand, were the philosophers (Dogmatists). In one important way the Dogmatists are not a "school" as such. They are often depicted by their detractors, such as the Empiricists, rather than being self-identifying. This may relate to the social class dynamics noted earlier. Thus, one should keep in mind that the group is not so much a school of practitioners but a depiction of a group by objectors to those who profess a foundation in medical theory. Perhaps the best way to characterize the Dogmatists would be on the issue of aetiology. The Empiricists attacked the Dogmatists for asserting that there might be hidden causes of disease, and that these hidden causes might be grasped via ratiocination. This was because (under this characterization) the Dogmatists were advocating reasoning and conjecture over experience. To the Empiricists, this was akin to creating a priori science.

The Dogmatists (even in this quasi-class depiction) were identified with one of the four prominent philosophical schools (Platonists, Aristotelians/Peripatetics, Stoics, and Epicureans). Detractors said that the Dogmatists honored theory over observation and experience. Of course, from the point of view of the philosophical schools, rational theories create a critical structure that aid in the interpretation and explanation of nature. The sense of explanation here harkens back to Aristotle, who distinguished knowing the fact (hoti) and the reasoned fact (dioti, APo II, i). It may not be enough to know that if I (as a physician) do x, then y will result (anecdotal correlation of two events). That sort of hoti (or merely event + consequence unit) is insufficient. The reason for this is that when circumstances alter slightly, how is the practitioner to know whether this alteration is significant unless he also has an appreciation of the mechanism that underlies the process? For example, anecdotal correlation might (in a non-medical modern example) suggest that every time I wash my car, it will rain. My personal experience may be almost perfect, but that does not mean that such a causal connection actually exists. The reluctance to embrace a non-observable causal mechanism leaves this dilemma to those who profess an aversion to theory in favor of experience.

Somewhat in the middle of these two schools were the Methodists. Aside from Soranus there are no surviving texts of the Methodists. Therefore most of what we have comes from the descriptions of Galen and pseudo-Galen on these writers. The following are cited as being Methodists: Thessalos, Themison, Proklos, Reginos, Antipatros, Eudemos, Mnaseas, Philon, Dionysios, Menemachos, Olympikos, Apollonides, Soranus, Julianus (Kühn X, 52-53, XIV, 684). There is some controversy about the characterization and origins of this school but many relate it to Themison of Laodicea a pupil of Asclepiades of Bithynia. However this attribution is disputed by Celsus and Soranus who state that Themison is not the first but merely a representative of Methodism. At any rate, the Methodists paid attention (in contrast to the Dogmatists and Empiricists) to the disease alone as opposed to the situation of the individual patient, that is, his medical history and personal situation. The disease alone dictates treatment (Kühn III, 14-20). Thus, the physician does not have to have anatomical or physiological knowledge of the body. Instead, he observes the body in a holistic manner (koinotetes). The three principle conditions of a body viewed in this way are: (a) the body's dryness, (b) the body's fluidity, and (c) the mixture of the two. The "method" to be followed was to follow the phenomena. Underlying this assumption was the notion about the status of pores in the mechanism of the body's common balance. The body's pores allowed atoms to enter and exit the body. When the atoms came and went freely health was the result. When there was a disruption, then sickness was the result. When the pores were either too small (constriction) or too large (dilatation) then an imbalance occurred in the normal atomic flow. Atoms are invisible to the naked eye. Pores are visible, but their subtle alterations are often not visibly detectable. Thus, on the face of it, the Methodists seem to be contra-Empiricist. However, the atomist tradition (upon which this theory rests) was taken to be Empiricist. (In principle, one could view an entirely physical event-if it were possible to witness it.) Thus, the Methodists seem to have affinities to both. This is evident in Themison (first century, BCE) and Thessalus (first century, AD). Disease was depicted as a community of constriction or dilatation (or some combination of the two) that, in principle, was observable even though, in practice, it couldn't be observed except through its effects, namely, the disease. Thus, though the intent of the Methodists was probably to lean toward the Empiricists, the actual practice put them more in-between.

Galen often characterizes himself as an eclectic belonging to no school. It is true that Galen was an innovator in observation, for example he gave the first depiction of the four-chambered human heart. But his epistemology was grounded in his philosophical training. Over and over Galen relies on an over-arching medical theory to drive his aetiology (Kühn X, 123, 159, 246). In this way his practice is closest to Aristotelian critical empiricism that requires careful observation and a comprehensive theory that will make those observations meaningful.

3. Method

Because of Galen's pluralistic method, it is appropriate that (for the most part) his own method draws upon his predecessors with additions and corrections. For example, Galen employed the four-element theory (earth, air, fire, and water) as well as the theories of the contraries (hot, cold, wet, and dry). Though Aristotle interrelated these two descriptive accounts in his work Generation and Corruption, it is Galen who attempts to create a more gradated form by making quasi-quantitative categories of the contraries to describe the material composition of the mixtures (On Mixtures). From the perspective of modern science, this is an advancement upon Aristotle. This work on mixtures is also used to account for the properties of drugs (On Simples). Drugs were supposed to counteract the disposition of the body. Thus, if a patient were suffering from cold and wet (upper respiratory infection), then the appropriate drug would be one that is hot and dry (such as certain molds and fungi-does this remind you of penicillin?). The use of broad-reaching natural principles enhanced the explanatory power of Galen's theory of biological science.

Galen speaks at length about the philosophers Plato (from whom he accepts the tri-partite soul) and Aristotle (whose biological works are well known to him). In medicine, he is also greatly influenced by historical figures such as Hippocrates (who he describes as a single individual opposed to our modern understanding of a group of writers-even though Galen was aware of the Hippocratic Question), Herophilus, and especially Erasistratus. In his avowed work on biological theory, On the Natural Faculties, Galen goes to great lengths to refute the principles of Erasistratus and his followers.

Contemporary figures are also discussed such as Aclepiades, and the Methodists Themison and Thessalus. This thorough use of the context of medicine allows Galen to consider, for example, Eristrates' theory of mechanical digestion via a vacuum principle and to supplant it with his own theory of attraction (holke). Galen's theory of attraction may have had its roots in the theory of natural place that always lacked a material force to implement it. At any rate, when the mechanisms are inscrutable, it was important for Galen to offer an account that fits into other parts of his theory (such as the mixture of the contraries in the composition of the elements).

One of the most influential aspects of Galenic practice was his implementation of (or invention of-as per Wesley Smith) the Hippocratic theory of the four humours (phlegm, blood, black bile, and yellow bile). These points of focus relate to a theory of health as balance. Each of these four humours is related to the three principal points of the body: head (phlegm), heart (blood), black bile (liver) and yellow bile (the liver's complement, the gall bladder). The three principal points of the body are also loosely linked to the Platonic tripartite soul: head (sophia, reason), heart (thumos, emotion or spiritedness), liver (epithumos, desire). Thus, the sort of just balance of the soul that Plato argues for in the Republic is also the ground of natural health. When one part of the soul/body is out of balance, then the individual becomes ill. The physician's job is to assist the patient in maintaining balance. If a person is too full of uncontrollable emotion or spiritedness, for example, then he is suffering from too much blood. The obvious answer is to engage in bloodletting (guaranteed to calm a person down). As in the case of pharmacology and the contraries, the four humours provide a comprehensive account of what it means to obtain and maintain health via the balancing of various primary principles.

4. Galen's Critical Empiricism

One of the striking features of ancient medicine is the extent that very limited observations had to be interpreted in order to explain natural function. For example, given that blood was considered to be nourishment, trophe, it seemed reasonable (following Aristotle) that the blood would be entirely consumed by the body's tissue. Thus, the blood would be manufactured in the liver and heart and then would flow to the rest of the body and be consumed. The flow of blood went one-way. However, there was a problem: there were two sorts of blood vessels (veins and arteries). These were structurally distinct. This was known through dissection of primates. Then it is assumed that Nature does nothing in vain (discussed at length in On the Use of the Parts as a key biomedical explanatory principle). This means that the veins and arteries have different functions. But they cannot be too disparate. The answer to this dilemma for Galen is that the arteries carry blood mixed with aer or pneuma that acts as a vital force whereas the venous blood is ordinary-though Galen held (correctly) that the two systems were connected by tiny almost invisible vessels (capillaries).

Thus Galen began with a problem and a number of observations and sought to make sense of the seeming anomalies via his overarching biomedical principles. In this way, Galen was acting according to the mathematical training from his father and a desire to create a unified (quasi-axiomatic) explanatory system. Without observation, this could have led to a priori or "armchair" science. But when combined with careful observation, it leads to critical empiricism.

Another example of this mixture of observation and inference is in the area of conception theory. Galen says in his treatise, On Seed,

These things have been said by me because of some of the philosophers who call themselves Aristotelians and Peripatetics. I, at least, would not address these men so, they being so greatly ignorant of the opinion of Aristotle that they think it is pleasing to him that the sperm of the male being cast into the uterus of the female places the principle of motion in the katamenia (the female seed) and, after this is expelled, the principle of motion in the katamenia and, after it is expelled, does not any part become the corporeal substance of the fetus. They have been deceived by the first book of the Generation of Animals that alone of the five they seem to have read. These things are written there, "As we said, of the generation of the principles we may say that chiefly there are the male principle and the female principle. The male offers the motive principle and the efficient cause of generation while the female offers the material principle" [Galen quoting Aristotle, G.A. 716a 5].

These are not far after the beginning: in still later parts of the tract he writes as well, "But this may be well concluded that the male provides the form and the principle of motion and the female provides the body and the matter just as the example of curding milk. Here the body is the milk and the fig juice contains the principle that makes it curdle" [Galen quoting Aristotle, G.A. 729a 10; Kühn IV, 516-517, my tr.].

The biological accounts of human reproduction in the ancient world offer excellent examples of the interaction between observation and inference. There are a number of issues involved in this issue that pre-dates even the Hippocratic writers. The one that is mentioned here is the issue of whether there is one seed (the male's only) or two (the male's and the female's). In the above example Galen seems to be saying that the first reading of Aristotle in which the male provides the efficient cause and the female provides the material cause, simpliciter, is a misreading of Aristotle. Instead, the event (conception) is depicted as a more involved process in which principles of both parents come into play. These principles revolve around the empirically observable facts that children as often as not resemble the mother as much as the father. The "one seed" theory in which the father's seed, alone, fashions the child can only account for such an outcome by calling it a sort of mutation (agone, para physin). But regularity counts for something. It is odd when an event that may approach or exceed 50% is called a mutation. This turns the entire idea of mutation (a statistical anomaly) on its head.

Galen approaches the issue with a balanced approach beginning with anatomical observations. Galen did some of the most extensive work in the ancient world on the study of the female anatomy (albeit mostly upon apes, On Anatomical Procedures, I.2). Galen's observation of a fluid in the horns of the uterus (Kühn IV, 594, 600-601) were the basis of his (mistaken) view that he had discovered female seed. However, in the midst of this mistake he was on the right track in viewing the ovaries as analogous to the male testes.

The point in this second example is that Galen wanted to combine his observations gained in dissections of apes to his pronouncements vis-à-vis the debate concerning "one seed conception" vs. "two seed conception." This commitment to integrating observation and theory contributed to making Galen a towering figure in medicine and the philosophy of science.

5. Select Bibliography

Primary Texts

  • Galeni Opera Omnia. Basel: Par'Andrea to Kratandro, 1538.Kühn, C.G. Galeni Opera Omnia. Leipzig: C. Cnobloch, 1821-1833, rpt. Hildesheim, 1965.
    • This is still the standard edition though it is very gradually being supplanted by the Corpus Medicorum Graecorum Leipzig, 1914-present.

Key Texts in Translation

  • Abhandlung darüber, dass der vorzügliche Arzt Philosoph sein muss. [Quod optimus medicus sit idem philosophus] translated by Peter Bachmann. Göttingen: Vanderhoeck & Ruprecht, 1996.L'Áme et ses passions: Les passions et les erreurs de l'áme. Translated and notes by Vincent Barras. Paris: Les Belle Lettres, 1995.
  • Galen on Antecedent Causes. Edited and translated with introduction and commentary by R.J. Hankinson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • Galen on Bloodletting. Translated by Peter Brain. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
  • Galen on Food and Diet. Translated and notes by Mark Grant. London: Routledge, 2000.
  • Galen's Institutio logica. Translated with commentary by John Spangler Kieffer. Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1964.
  • Galen on Language and Ambiguity (De captionibus). Translated with commentary by Robert Blair Edlow. Leiden: Brill, 1977.
  • Galen on the Natural Faculties. Translated by Arthur John Brock. London: Heineiman, Ltd., 1952. Loeb series.
  • Galen on the Usefulness of the Parts of the Body {De usu partium). Translated with commentary by Margaret Tallmadge May. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1968.
  • Galen, The Therapeutic Method: Books 1 & 2 (De methodo medendi). Edited and translated by R.J. Hankinson. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991.

Selected Secondary Sources

  • Barnes, Jonathan. "A Third Sort of Syllogism: Galen and the Logic of Relations" in Modern Thinkers and Ancient Thinkers. R. W. Sharples, ed. Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1993.Boylan, Michael. "Galen's Conception Theory" Journal of the History of Biology 19.1 (1986): 44-77.
  • Boudon-Millot, ed, fr. tr. Introduction génerale; sur ses propres livres que l’excellent médecin devienne philosophe. Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 2007.
  • Boudon-Millot, And Alessia Guardasole, and Caroline Magdelaine, eds. La science médicale antique: nouveaux regards: etudes reunites en l’honneur de Jacques Jouanna. Paris: Beauchesne, 2007.
  • Boylan, Michael. “Galen on the Blood, Pulse, and Arteries” Journal of the History of Biology 40.2 (2007): 207-230.
  • Boylan, Michael. "The Hippocratic and Galenic Challenges to Aristotle's Conception Theory" Journal of the History of Biology 15.1 (1984): 83-112.
  • Connell, Sophia. "Aristotle and Galen on Sex Difference and Reproduction: A New Approach to an Ancient Rivalry." Studies in History and the Philosophy of Science. 31-a.3(2000):405-427.
  • Cosans, Christopher E. "The Experimental Foundations of Galen's Teleology" Studies in History and Philosophy of Science. 29A.1 (1998): 63-90.
  • Crombie, A. C. Augustine to Galileo. Vol. 1. London: Heinemann, 1961.
  • DeLacy, Philip. "Galen's Platonism" American Journal of Philology. 93 (1972): 27-39.
  • Durling, Richard. A Dictionary of Medical Terms. Leiden: Brill, 1993.
  • Edelstein, Ludwig. Ancient Medicine. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1967.
  • Farrington, B. Greek Science: Theophrastus to Galen. Baltimore, MD: Penguin, 1953.
  • Fischer, Klaus-Dietrich ed., Text and Tradition: Studies in Ancient Greek Medicine and its Transmission: Presented to Jutta Kollesch Leiden: Brill, 1998.
  • Frede, Michael. "The Empiricist Attitude toward Reason and Theory" Apeiron. 21 (1988): 79-97.
  • Freudiger, Jurg. "Methodus resolutiva: Antikes und Neuzeitliches in Jacopo Acontios Methodenschrift" Freiburger Zeitschrift für Philosophie und Theologie. 45.3 (1998): 407-446.
  • Gill, Christopher. "Galen vs. Chrysippus on the Tripartite Psyche in 'Timaeus' 69-72" in Interpreting the 'Timaeus-Critias. Tomas Calvo ed. Sankt Augustin: Academia: 1997.
  • Gill, Christopher. "Did Chrysippus Understand Medea?" Phronesis. 28.2 (1983): 136-149.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "Actions and Passions" in Passions and Perceptions. Martha Nussbaum, ed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Hankinson, R.J. The Cambridge Companion to Galen. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "Galen's Anatomy of the Soul" Phronesis 36.3 (1991): 197-233.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "A Purely Verbal Dispute? Galen on Stoic and Academic Epistemology" Revue Internationale de Philosophie. 45.178 (1991): 267-300.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "Evidence, Externality and Antecendence: Inquiries Into Later Greek Causal Concepts." Phronesis 32.1 (1987): 80-100.
  • Hankinson, R. J. "Causes and Empiricism: A Problem in the Interpretation of Later Greek Medical Method." Phronesis 32.4 (1987): 329-348.
  • Kagan, Jerome, Nancy Snidman, Doreen Ardus, J. Steven Rezinck. Galen's Prophecy: Temperament in Human Nature. NY: Basic Books, 1994.
  • Kember, O. "Right and Left in the Sexual Theories of Parmenides" Journal of Hellenic Studies. 91 (1971): 70-79.
  • Kidd, I. G. "Posidonius on Emotions" in Problems in Stoicism. A. A. Long, ed. London: Athlone, 1971.
  • Kollesch, Jutta. Galen über das Riechorgan. Berlin: Akademie-Verlag, 1964.
  • Kollesch, Jutta and Diethard Nickel, eds. Galen und das hellenistische Erbe. Stuttgart: Franz Steiner, 1993.
  • Kudlien, Fridolf and Richard J. Durling. Galen's Method of Healing. Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1991.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Methods and Problems in Greek Science. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Greek Science After Aristotle. New York: Norton, 1973.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. "Parmenides' Sexual Theories: A Reply to MER Kember" Journal of Hellenic Studies. 92 (1972): 178-179.
  • Lumpe, Adolf. "Der logische Grundgedanke der vierten Schlussfigur." Prima Philosophia. 11.4 (1998): 397-404.
  • Lumpe, Adolf. "Zur Anordnung der Pramissen des kategorischen Syllogismus bei Albinos, Galenus und Pseudo-Apuleius" Prima Philosophia 8.2 (1995): 115-124.
  • Mansfield, Jaap. "The Idea of the Will in Chrysippus, Posidonius, and Galen" Proceedings of the Boston Area Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy 7 (1991): 107-145.
  • Manuli, Paola. "Galien et le Stoicisme" Revue de Mataphysique et de Morale 97.3 (1992): 365-375.
  • Mowry, Bryan. "From Galen's Theory to William Harvey's Theory: A Case Study in the Rationality of Scientific Theory Change" Studies in History and the Philosophy of Science 16 (1985): 49-82.
  • Nutton, Vivian. Ancient Medicine. London: Routledge, 2004.
  • Nutton, Vivian. "The Chronology of Galen's Early Career" Classical Quarterly 23 (1973): 158-171.
  • Nutton, Vivian. (ed.) Galen: Problems and Prospects. London: Wellcome Institute, 1981.
  • Nutton, Vivian. "Galen ad multos annos" Dynamis 15 (1995): 25-39.
  • Rescher, Nicholas. Galen and the Syllogism: An Examination of the Thesis that Galen Originated the Fourth Figure of the Syllogism in Light of New Data from the Arabic. Pittsburgh, PA: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1996.
  • Sarton, George. Galen of Pergamon. Lawrence, KS: University of Kansas Press, 1954.
  • Siegel, Rudolph. Galen's System of Physiology and Medicine. Basel: Karger, 1968.
  • Smith, Wesley. The Hippocratic Tradition. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1979.
  • Temkin, Owsei. Galenism: The Rise and Decline of a Medical Philosophy. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1973.
  • Tieleman, Teun. "Plotinus on the Seat of the Soul: Reverberations of Galen and Alexander in Enn. IV, 3 27ESS, 23." Phronesis. 43.4 (1998): 306-325.

Select Proceedings of Conferences on Galen

1981 English

  • Nutton, Vivian, Galen : Problems and Prospects. London: Wellcome Institute for the History of Medicine, 1981.

1982 English

  • Kudlien, F., & Durling, R. J. Galen's method of healing : Proceedings of the 1982 Galen Symposium. Paper presented at the Galen Symposium (1982 : Christian-Albrechts Universität); Studies in Ancient Medicine,; v. 1, 205. Leiden: Brill, 1991.

1986 3rd Italian

  • Manuli, P., & Vegretti, M. (1988). Le Opere Psicologiche di Galeno : Atti del terzo Colloquio Galenico Internazionale, Pavia, 10-12 Settembre 1986. Paper presented at the Colloqio Galenico Internazionale (3d : 1986 : Pavia, Italy); Elenchos (Bibliopolis (Firm)) 13,

1989 4th German

  • Kollesch, J., Nickel, D., Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin, & Institut für Geschichte der Medizin. (1993). Galen und das Hellenistische Erbe : Verhandlungen des IV. Internationalen Galen-Symposiums veranstaltet vom Institut für Geschichte der Medizin am Bereich Medizin (charité) der Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin 18.-20. September 1989. Paper presented at the Galen Symposium (4th : 1989 : Humboldt-Universität Zu Berlin); Sudhoffs Archiv.; Beihefte,; Heft 32,

1995 5th English

  • Debru, A. (1997). Galen on Pharmacology : Philosophy, history, and medicine : Proceedings of the Vth International Galen Colloquium, Lille, 16-18 March 1995. Paper presented at the International Galen Colloquium (5th : 1995 : Lille, France); Studies in Ancient Medicine,; v. 16, 336. Leiden: Brill, 2007.

1988 Spanish

  • López Férez, J. A. (1991). Galeno, obra, pensamiento e influencia : Coloquio internacional celebrado en Madrid, 22-25 de marzo de 1988. Madrid : Universidad Nacional de Educación a Distancia, 1991.

2002 Italian

  • Garofalo, I., Roselli, A., Fischer, K., Galen, On the therapeutic method, & Book III. (2003). Galenismo e Medicina Tardoantica : Fonti greche, latine e arabe : Atti del Seminario Internazionale di Siena, Certosa di Pontignano, 9 e 10 Settembre 2002. Paper presented at the Annali Dell'Istituto Universitario Orientale Di Napoli.; Sezione Filologico-Letteraria.; Quaderni,; 7,

2002 English

  • Nutton, Vivian. The Unknown Galen. London : Institute of Classical Studies, School of Advanced Study, University of London, 2002.

Author Information

Michael Boylan
Email: michael.boylan@marymount.edu
Marymount University
U. S. A.

Ge Hong (Ko Hung, 283—343 C.E.)

Ge_HongGe Hong was an eclectic philosopher who dedicated his life to searching for physical immortality, which he thought was attainable through alchemy. He lived during China's tumultuous Period of Disunity (220-589 C.E.), a time in which alien conqueror regimes ruled northern China, the cradle of Chinese civilization, while a series of weak, transplanted Chinese states occupied recently colonized southern China. These political conditions, along with the social chaos they engendered, no doubt gave rise to Ge Hong's ardent desire to establish order and permanency in both his spiritual and secular worlds. His most important contribution to Chinese philosophy was his attempt to reconcile an immortality-centered Daoism with Confucianism. Equally important, to establish political order, he also tried to reconcile Legalism with Confucianism. His penetrating insight was that the teachings of no one school could solve the problems that his world faced – only a combination of the best methods of each could do so.

Table of Contents

  1. The Life of Ge Hong
  2. Immortality
  3. Reconciliation of Daoism and Confucianism
  4. Confucianism and Legalism
  5. The Importance of Broad Knowledge
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Life of Ge Hong

In 283 C.E., Ge Hong was born into a southern magnate family whose native place was the Jurong district in Danyang prefecture, which was near Nanjing, in the southwest corner of present day Jiangsu province. Both his grandfather and father had reputations for broad learning and served as high ministers for the Wu state, which ruled over southeastern China from 220-280. Ge's father continued to hold a number of middle level positions under the Western Jin dynasty (265-317) that briefly reunited China. Upon his father's death in 296, Ge endured a period of relative poverty and lost his family's extensive library due to civil strife. To educate himself, from this time on, he started copying books and reading voraciously. He began with the Confucian classics, but soon turned his attention to the various philosophical writings. Under the tutelage of Zheng Yin, who was both a Confucian classicist and a Daoist adept, Ge began his studies of the immortality arts. Zheng Yin himself was a disciple of Ge's uncle, Ge Xuan (164-244), a Daoist adept who was reputed to have become an immortal.

Like other southern gentry, Ge Hong's early career was spent in military positions. He had an extensive knowledge of martial affairs and was trained in the use of arms. In 303, at the age of twenty, he was called upon to organize and lead a militia in his native place against a rebel army, which he handily defeated. In a rare admission of violence for a Chinese literatus, he even relates that, with bow and arrow, two men and a horse died at his hands. In 305, after being promoted to the rank of a General Who Makes the Waves Submit, Ge tried to make his way to Luoyang, the capital. Although his autobiography tells us he did so "to look for unusual books," he was probably also hoping to obtain a promotion. However, due to the Rebellion of the Eight Princes that was being fought throughout northern China, he never made it; instead, he wandered throughout southern China. To escape from the turmoil that was embroiling the rest of China, he finally accepted a position as a military councilor under his friend who was appointed to be the governor of Guangzhou (Canton), a port city in the far south.

After his patron was killed enroute to assuming the governorship, Ge refused many other military appointments and remained in Guangzhou for the next eight years, living the life of a recluse at nearby Mount Luofu. In 314, he returned to his native place of Jurong. There, he studied under another Daoist adept named Bao Qing (260-330), the former governor of Nanhai prefecture, who was so impressed that he gave Ge his eldest daughter in marriage. It was during this long period of reclusion that Ge wrote his two part magnum opus whose title bore his sobriquet: the Inner Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity and the Outer Chapters of the Master Who Embraces Simplicity. Ge used the Daoist Inner Chapters to substantiate the reality of immortality and convey the methods for realizing it, while the Confucian Outer Chapters describe the problems afflicting the secular world and his proposed solutions. In fact, until the fourteenth century, the Inner Chapters and Outer Chapters circulated independently from each other. With these two works, Ge aspired to establish his own school of philosophy. Also at this time, illustrative of his aspirations, Ge compiled hagiographical works entitled Biographies of Divine Transcedents and Biographies of Recluses.

With the establishment of the Eastern Jin dynasty in southern China in 317, the transplanted throne was eager to gain the allegiance of powerful southern gentry families; thus, men such as Ge Hong were showered with official appointments, which were usually more honorary than substantive in nature. In recognition of his past military successes, Ge himself was given the title of Marquis of the Region Within the Pass. Finally, in 326, Wang Dao (276-339), the prime minister, appointed him to a series of positions, ending with that of military advisor. By 332, due to his advanced age (he was 50) and desire to find ingredients for immortality elixirs, he begged to be given a post in northern part of present-day Vietnam. On his way there, the governor of Guangzhou, Deng Yue, detained him there indefinitely. He thus took up residence at nearby Mount Luofu where he engaged in immortality practices until his death in 343.

By his own admission, Ge Hong was a man that was out of sorts with his age. He was a southerner in an age where only northern émigrés were given posts of substance. Due to his lack of verbal eloquence, he could never obtain social prestige in the salons where men were prized for their ability to engage in "Pure Talk" - abstract philosophical discussions. Nor did his strong Confucian sense of morality sit well with the libertine tendencies of that prevailed among the northern émigrés. The outlet of his frustrations became his writings, in which he attacked the fashions and trends of his day and proposed his own vision of how people should obtain stability in an instable world.

2. Immortality

Ge Hong wholeheartedly believed that anyone, through unrelenting effort and study, could obtain immortality. One does not have to be either rich or powerful to do so; in fact, wealth and position are harmful because they inhibit one from attaining the necessary moral and physical serenity. Moreover, it is not up to the arbitrary decisions of deities to extend our lives - they are merely divine administrators who keep track of our sins and good deeds; consequently, sacrifices and prayers to them for this purpose are useless. Thus, whether one can obtain immortality is entirely based on his or her own diligence and determination. It was precisely for those educated people who wanted and were willing to work towards obtaining immortality that Ge wrote his Inner Chapters. The overriding importance that he attached to obtaining eternal life is evident in that the inner, and thereby his most important, chapters of his magnum opus were dedicated to the topic.

Ge Hong firmly believed that physical immortality was possible. This is because all things are permeated by the metaphysical oneness, xuan (the mystery), which creates and animates all things. Significantly, for Ge, xuan is synonymous with the words dao (the way, the ultimate reality) and yi (the one, the unity). In this light, he describes xuan in the following manner: it "carries within it the embryo of the Original One, it forms and shapes the two Principles (Yin and Yang); it exhales and absorbs the great Genesis, it inspires and transforms the multitude of species, it makes constellations go round, it shaped the primordial Darkness, it guides the wonderful mainspring of the universe, it exhales the four seasons … if one adds to it, it does not increase. If one takes away from it, it does not grow less. If something is given to it, it is not increased in glory. If something is taken from it, it does not suffer. Where the Mystery is present, joy is infinite; where the Mystery has departed, efficacy is exhausted and the spirit disappears" (Robinet, 82-83). In other words, the key to immortality is maintaining this everlasting oneness within oneself - if one cannot do so, he or she will soon die. The reason why people lose it is that they become attached through their desires to the outside world, thereby forgetting the jewel that resides within. As Ge put it, "The way of xuan is obtained within oneself, but is lost due to things outside oneself. Those who employ xuan are gods; those who forget it are merely [empty] vessels."

How does one maintain the unity within oneself? For Ge Hong it had much to do with preserving, enhancing, and refining one's qi, which for him embodied the metaphysical mystery. Qi, which originally meant "breath" or "vapor," came to designate the vital energy that exists within and animates all things. As Ge Hong relates, "people reside within qi and qi resides within people. From heaven and earth down to the ten thousand things, each one requires qi to live. As for those who excel at circulating their qi, internally they are able to nourish their body; externally, they are able to repel illnesses." Since each person receives a finite amount of qi at birth, he recommends various methods to retain and enhance it, which include breathing exercises, sexual techniques, calisthenics, dietary restrictions, and the ingestion of herbal medicines. Since none of these methods is infallible, he recommends that an adept should practice a number of them in combination with each other. By doing so, one protects oneself from manifold disasters, such as illnesses, demons, savage beasts and weapons, while also lessening desires, transforming the body, and extending one's lifespan. These methods could even give their practitioners supernatural powers, such as curing illnesses, raising the dead, seeing the future, commanding gods and ghosts, forgoing food for years, and the ability to disappear.

Nevertheless, none of these techniques could permanently keep xuan within oneself. To do that, nothing was comparable with taking alchemically created medicines. Ge thus informs us that, "Even if one performs breathing exercises and calisthenics, as well as ingests herbal medicines, this can only extend the years of your lifespan, but it will not save you from death. Ingesting divine cinnabar will make your lifespan inexhaustible. You will last as long as heaven and earth, be able to travel on clouds and ride dragons, and ascend at will to the Heaven of Highest Clarity." Alchemically derived medicines, the best of which contained either liquefied gold or reverted cinnabar, were able to have this marvelous effect because the substances from which they were made had shown themselves, through repeated firings in the alchemist's stove, to be impervious to decay or dissolution. According to Ge, "As for forging of gold and cinnabar, the longer one burns them, the more marvelous their transformations. When gold enters the flames, even after one hundred firings, it will not disappear. If you bury it forever, it will never decay. If one ingests these two substances, they will refine that person's body, and make it so that he or she will neither age nor die." In other words, one makes one's own body imperishable by ingesting imperishable things. Mechanically what happens is that, upon ingestion, these substances seep into one's blood and qi, thereby making them stronger. Ge Hong calls this using an outside substance to fortify one's self. The reason why herbs are inferior to gold and cinnabar is that they are perishable; thus, they lack the capacity to make the body imperishable. Unfortunately though, the ingredients for making these mineral medicines are difficult to obtain, the process of smelting them is arduous, and the ritual circumstances under which they must be made are elaborate; as a result, Ge Hong several times admits that he has never had enough resources to attempt to produce these superb formulas.

3.Reconciliation of Daoism and Confucianism

It is often said of premodern Chinese literati that they were Daoist at home while Confucian in the office. Ge Hong was in fact probably one of the first Chinese thinkers to consciously try to reconcile Confucianism and Daoism. As the division of his major work into inner and outer chapters indicates, he did so by asserting that Confucianism and Daoism addressed different aspects of life. Confucianism addressed the external world and provided means by which to ameliorate its many problems; Daoism concerned the inner world and provided means by which to attain immortality. As Ge succinctly put it, "For an extraordinarily talented person, what difficulty could there be in practicing both (Confucianism and Daoism) at the same time? Inwardly, such people treasure the way of nourishing life; outwardly, they exhibit their brilliance in the world. If they regulate their persons, their persons then will be cultivated for a prolonged time; if they rule the country, the country will achieve the state of great peace." Cultivating one's spirit for immortality thereby automatically enables one to rule a country well. Thus, if one becomes a terrestrial immortal, Ge Hong sees no reason why such a person cannot hold office and contribute to the welfare of his generation.

Nevertheless, even though both were important, Daoism was even more so. That is because in the far past the sage kings followed the Dao "the oneness" or "the natural order of things," as a result, the people's conduct was flawless and natural processes transpired smoothly without disruption or disaster. Later kings, however, no longer followed the Dao; consequently, natural disasters occurred frequently and people became evil and unruly. It was only at this point that Confucianism was introduced in an attempt to rectify this situation. Thus, Daoism is superior because it kept the world from becoming chaotic; Confucianim, on the other hand, only appeared when the world declined into disorder and its practitioners have often become entangled in the resulting mess. Thus, Daoists, like Confucians, provide the world with moral order, but they do so without becoming soiled in the process. As Ge Hong put it, "In regard to the Daoists, their making consists of excelling in cultivating the self to complete their duties; their repose consists in excelling in doing away with the impurities of people; their governance consists of excelling in cutting off misfortune before it occurs; their giving consists in excelling at saving things, but not considering it virtuous; their activity consist in excelling at using their heart-mind to urge the people [to do good]; their quiescence consists in excelling at being cautious and without rancor. These characteristics are why Daoism is the ruler and leader of the hundred schools of philosophy and why it is the ancestor of [Confucian] righteous and benevolence." Nevertheless, since only a few people are able to correctly pursue Daoism and present times are disordered, Confucianism is necessary to maintain the social order that is embodied in the family and the state. Very much in a Confucian vein, he evaluates both philosophies through a moral lenses.

One of the ways in which Ge Hong connected Confucianism and Daoism is by stating that one needed to perfect oneself ethically to pursue immortality. In his Inner Chapters, Ge Hong makes it clear that none of the methods for prolonging one's life will work unless one is morally pure, which can only happen by realizing Confucian virtues. Ge explicitly states that, "those who seek to become immortals must regard loyalty, filiality, peacefulness, obedience, benevolence and trustworthiness as fundamental. If one does not cultivate his or her moral behavior, and merely instead devotes oneself to esoteric methods, he or she will never obtain an extended lifespan." Since these virtues, particularly that of benevolence (ren), emphasize putting the interests of others before one's own, they cultivated a sense of selflessness and detachment that Ge viewed as essential for maintaining the mysterious oneness within oneself.

His strong emphasis on morality led him to systematize and quantify earlier ideas about how spirits punished immoral behavior. Ge Hong maintained that for each minor moral transgression one committed, the Director of Fates would subtract three days from his or her lifespan; for each major transgression, three hundred days would be deducted. To guide people's behavior, he even listed sixty-four possible sins. Very few of these prohibitions are religious in nature - the overwhelming majority concern secular life and many are Confucian inspired. Furthermore, he posited that, to achieve spiritual benefits, one had to continuously accumulate good deeds: 300 were needed to become an earthbound immortal and 1200 to become a celestial immortal. One mishap and the balance would be canceled. Ge Hong even transformed the three corpses, evil entities within the body who endeavor to destroy it to earn their freedom, into ethical agents that try to decimate their host's health by disclosing his sins to the celestial authorities. This system of measuring good and bad deeds would later giver rise to the Ledgers of Merit and Demerit, popular books that let people keep track of their moral progress by assigning numerical scores to virtuous and immoral behavior.

Ge Hong also attempted to reconcile Daoism with Confucianism by both emphasizing the importance and naturalness of hierarchy and attacking Daoism's equalitarian tendencies. Although Laozi and Zhuangzi always assumed that kings would exist, their utopian vision of society was a small village society whose inhabitants never leave their hamlets, do not use contrivances, and have few material goods. In order to attack this line of thinking in his Outer Chapters, Ge Hong puts forth the views of a man named Bao Jingyan who extended the Daoist arguments to their logical conclusion. Bao maintains that the simple agrarian utopias in which people lived simply and equally were lost due to the creation of hierarchy, which was based on the strong oppressing the weak and the smart deceiving the foolish. With the lord/subject tie came a host of evils such as weapons, armies, rebellions, greed, thievery, deceit, extravagance, and crime. Thus, Bao advocated the abolishment of rulers as the key to securing peace and happiness. Incidentally, Bao is the earliest known Chinese advocate of anarchy. Ge Hong, on the contrary, thinks that in a state of nature people think only of their own desires, hence they vie with each other like beasts for scarce resources. Hierarchy was thus established to put an end to the strong oppressing the weak. Moreover, hierarchy is natural: as the oneness unfolds into the ten thousand things, it divides itself into high and low; hence, heaven is above and earth is below. Thus, it is only natural that some people are more important than others. This is true to the extent that even immortals are hierarchically organized: freshly minted immortals must occupy the lower rungs of the celestial bureaucracy and serve their superiors, while terrestrial immortals are inferior to their celestial counterparts. Ge also recognized that civilization could not be undone and that hierarchy had brought about material progress, as the following passage indicates: "Now, [would you be at ease] if I made you reside in the cramped quarters of a nest or cave? [Would you be at ease] if upon your death, your body was abandoned in the fields? [Would you be at ease] if upon being impeded by a river, you had to swim to cross it? [Would you be at ease] if upon traveling through the mountains, you had to walk and shoulder luggage? [Would you be at ease] if your cooking implements were cast away and you had to make do with raw and smelly food? [Would you be at ease] if you no longer had stone needles for acupuncture and had to merely rely on nature to [cure] your illness? [Would you be at ease] if nakedness was your only ornament and you had no clothes? [Would you be at ease] if you came across a female and made her your mate without an intermediary? You and I would both likely say, 'to do these things would be impossible.' How much less could we do without a lord!" In other words, progress and hierarchy are realities, and beneficial ones at that, which can neither be ignored nor abandoned.

4. Confucianism and Legalism

Since Ge Hong recognized that this world cannot be ignored, he believed that one must find a way to improve it. Given the corruption and chaos that ruled his age, like many of his contemporaries, he looked for answers beyond Confucianism to its arch nemesis, Legalism. His reform program was thus a synthesis of both Confucian and Legalist political ideas. First of all, even though he believed that the ruler, like a good Confucian sovereign, should cultivate his person, lead the people through his own moral example, and take their welfare as his overriding concern, he admitted that this was not sufficient to guide society. To govern well, one had to have clear laws to punish miscreants. He warns us that, "It is not that governing with benevolence is not wonderful, it is just that the black-haired masses can be crafty and deceitful. They hanker after profit and forget righteousness. If one does not order them with one's authority and correct them with punishments, if one only admires the ways of Fuxi and Shennong (Confucian cultural heroes), then chaos cannot be avoided and the resulting calamities will be numerous. [Yet] to use killing to stop killing, how could anyone find joy in that?" In short, although leading through one's moral example is preferable, it is not realistic: it is sometimes necessary to use the harsher methods. Since Confucian moral example was not enough, the ruler must turn to the law and mete out punishments. Following Legalist ideas, Ge argues that the laws must be clear, explicit, and fair; i.e., they must be applicable to everyone. Moreover, the punishments for misbehavior must be severe. It is precisely generous rewards and harsh punishments that will keep the strong from oppressing the weak. Regimes are weak because their laws are neither severe nor enforced. In line with this thinking, Ge was in favor of reviving punishments that mutilated the guilty. Convicts suffering from such punishments would be constant reminders to the people of the terrible price to be paid for violating the law. Lest the modern reader judge Ge harshly for supporting such draconian measures, since the death penalty largely replaced the mutilation punishments, Ge thought the latter was more humane, since at least the criminal would escape with his or her life.

Another way in which Ge Hong tried to reconcile Confucianism and Legalism was through the type of training officials should receive. Under the Legalist Qin dynasty (221-207 BCE), which unified China for the first time, officials were largely men who excelled in legal and administrative matters. During the Han dynasty (206 BCE - 220 CE), particularly during its latter half, Confucianism gradually became the dominant ideology, hence the education and knowledge of officials became more centered on the Confucian classics. Men who primarily specialized in legal matters were slighted and only given clerical positions. Due to this situation, Ge complained that officials, no matter what their level, no longer understood the laws, hence they often issued incorrect judgments and were deceived by their more legally savvy underlings. Consequently, he thought that aspirants to officialdom should be tested not only on the Confucian classics, but also on the law.

5. The Importance of Broad Knowledge

That officials should be knowledgeable in both the classics and the law highlights one of his most consistent teachings: a person must be broadly educated and that deep study leads to the mastery of all things. For Ge Hong, through the diligent acquisition of knowledge, anything was possible, whether it be ruling a country or attaining immortality. In this vein, he said, "When one peels away dark clouds, one exposes the sun; as a result, the ten thousand things cannot hide their shapes. By unrolling bamboo and silk (that is, by reading books) and investigating the past and present, heaven and earth thereby hide none of their facts. How much less so gods and demons? And how much less so the affairs of people?" Nevertheless, one could not just specialize in one kind of learning, but had to learn the teachings of many different schools. Likewise, in seeking immortality, one should study many techniques and never merely practice one exclusively. Similarly, in terms of book learning, one should not merely confine oneself to learning the classics because all written works had something of worth. Indeed, he propounded the revolutionary sentiment that the elaborate writings of his day were superior to the simplistic classics. The more widely one read, and the more techniques one acquired, the more one would be likely to excel in both the spiritual and secular worlds. Study was also a means of self-cultivation - through it one could eliminate desires by becoming indifferent to his or her physical circumstances.

According to Ge Hong, one of the primary reasons governance of his time was so inept and ineffective was that officials were not selected on the basis of their intelligence, but only due to their connections, bribery, or their ability to speak eloquently. Ge thought the solution to this problem would be to use examinations to select men on the basis of their knowledge of the classics and administrative matters. The examinations should be held in the palace, supervised by high officials, and their contents should be kept in the utmost secrecy. By this means, there would be little opportunity to pass the examinations through deceit or bribery. Moreover, when the only way to become an official is through examinations, everyone will value study. Although he admitted that passing the examinations would not guarantee that that person would be a good official, he thought that the ability to do so was a fair indicator of talent. In other words, Ge Hong was one of the earliest proponents of selecting officials through a vigorous and fair examination system, one of the hallmarks of Chinese civilization.

6. Conclusion

In sum, Ge Hong was a philosopher who, due to the topsy-turvy world in which he lived, was willing to look for solutions in the wisdom of any philosopher, regardless of his sectarian background. With Ge's overriding sense of the importance of morality and his overwhelming urge for permanency in the form of immortality, he reconciled Confucian and Daoism by saying that both were trying to improve the condition of mankind and that practicing Confucian virtues was necessary for attaining immortality. Likewise, this search for concrete, no-nonsense answers also led him to reconcile his Confucian leanings with the real politick teachings of Legalism. Thus, although he maintained that the ruler must endeavor to mold his people's behavior through his own example, generous rewards and severe punishments were even more important in regulating the affairs of the troublesome masses. In order to manifest both these philosophies, Ge advocated that officials be both experts in the classics and legal matters. Thus, Ge helped fashion the values that allowed latter Chinese to unproblematically simultaneously use Daoist, Confucian, and Legalist assumptions in both their public and private lives.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Balazs, Etienne. Chinese Civilization and Bureaucracy. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1964.
    • Besides giving a valuable introduction to the tumultuous intellectual and social milieu in which Ge Hong lived, this work also translates part of the chapter from his Outer Chapters in which Ge Hong critiques the anarchist Bao Jingyan.
  • Campany, Robert Ford. To Live as Long as Heaven and Earth: A Translation and Study of Ge Hong's Traditions of Divine Transcendents. Berkeley: University of California Press, 2002.
    • This fine translation of Ge Hong's biographies of immortals has an introduction that insightfully describes his religious ideas.
  • Lai Chi-Tim, "Ko Hung's Discourse of Hsien-Immortality: A Daoist Configuration of an Alternate Ideal Self-Identity," Numen 45 (1998): 183-220.
    • Although somewhat turgid, this article successfully delineates the novel aspects of Ge Hong's views on immortality and situates his religious beliefs within the social and political context in which they were formed.
  • Robinet, Isabelle. Daoism: Growth of a Religion, translated by Phyllis Brooks. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1997.
    • Robinet devotes an entire chapter of this work to Ge Hong and masterfully contextualizes his thought within the Daoist religious tradition.
  • Sailey, Jay. The Master Who Embraces Simplicity: A Study of the Philosopher Ko Hung, A.D. 283-343. San Francisco: Chinese Materials Center, Inc., 1978.
    • The author translates twenty-one chapters of Ge Hong's Outer Chapters. He also deftly summarizes Ge Hong's ideas as seen in this work.
  • Sivin, Nathan. "On the Pao P'u Tzu Nei Pien and the Life of Ko Hong (283-343)," Isis 60 (1976): 388-391.
    • In this short article, Sivin makes some important points about the circulation of his works and the length of his life.
  • Sivin, Nathan. "On the Word 'Daoist' as a Source of Perplexity." History of Religions 17 (1978): 303-330.
    • This intellectually penetrating article challenges the idea that Ge Hong was a Daoist at all, in the sense that he was not at all connected with organized Daoist religion.
  • Ware, James R. Alchemy, Medicine & Religion in the China of A.D. 320: The Nei P'ien of Ko Hung. Rpt; New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1981.
    • Originally published in 1966, this work is a complete translation of Ge Hong's The Inner Chapters. The reader must beware, though, since the text is inaccurately translated through Judeo-Christian lenses.
  • Yu, David C. History of Chinese Daoism: Volume 1. Lanham: University Press of America, 2000.
    • This overview of the history of Daoism devotes a lengthy chapter to Ge Hong with extensive quotations to his views on immortality.

Author Information

Keith Knapp
Email: keith.knapp@citadel.edu
The Citadel
U. S. A.

Ignacio Ellacuría (1930—1989)

Ignacio Ellacuría, a naturalized citizen of El Salvador, was born in Spain in 1930. He joined the Jesuits in 1947 and was quickly sent to El Salvador, where he lived and worked for the next forty-two years, except for periods when he was pursuing his education in Ecuador, Spain, and West Germany. He developed an important and novel contribution to Latin American Liberation Philosophy. The body of thought known as Liberation Philosophy developed in Latin America in the second half of the Twentieth Century. It grew out of the works of philosophers working in Peru (A. Salazar Bondy) and Mexico (Leopoldo Zea), and quickly spread throughout Latin America. It resulted from efforts by these philosophers to create a Latin American philosophy by looking at how the discipline could help to make sense of Latin American reality. That reality, as distinct from the European (and later North American) context in which the modern Western philosophical tradition developed, is one of dependence on economic and political (and to some extent cultural) factors that are beyond one’s control. In thematizing dependency, Latin American philosophy developed a liberation philosophy that focused on the social and personal imperative to overcome dependency as the path toward the fullness of one’s humanity, given the conditions of dependency. There are at least five different schools within Latin American liberation philosophy (see Cerutti in the Bibliography below), but all are grounded in the attempt to use philosophy to understand the Latin American reality of dependency and the need to overcome it.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Ellacuría’s Philosophy of Liberation
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Ellacuría's initial training in philosophy was in the Neo-Scholasticism required at that time of all Jesuits. Later he studied Ortega, Bergson, Heidegger, phenomenology, and the existentialists. All of these influenced him, but the key influences in the make up of his mature philosophical thought were Hegel, Marx, and the Basque philosopher Xavier Zubiri (1898-1983). Ellacuría worked on his doctorate under Zubiri from 1962 to 1965, writing a dissertation that reached some 1100 pages on the concept of essence in Zubiri's thought. He also studied theology with the great Heideggerian Jesuit, Karl Rahner, and had finished all the requirements for a second PhD, but did not write the dissertation (which he was also going to write under Zubiri). For the next 18 years, until Zubiri's death in 1983, they were close collaborators, with Ellacuría returning to Spain from El Salvador for a few months each year to facilitate their work. The two worked together on most of Zubiri's texts and talks, eventually reaching the point where Zubiri would not publish something, or even present a lecture, without first showing the material to Ellacuría.

Zubiri is a major figure in 20th century Spanish philosophy and has had a lot of influence in Latin America, largely through the efforts of Ellacuría, but his work is not well known in the countries more traditionally associated with Continental Philosophy (France and Germany) or in the Anglo-American tradition. By the age of 23, Zubiri had finished both a PhD in theology at the Gregorian University and a PhD in philosophy at the University of Madrid. At 28 he was named to the prestigious chair in the history of philosophy at the University of Madrid, and for the next few years he traveled widely in Europe to study with experts in many different fields: philosophy with Husserl and Heidegger, physics with Schrödinger and De Broglie, as well as biology and mathematics with luminaries of the day. Zubiri also taught in Paris at the Institut Catholique and at the University of Barcelona, but in 1942 he left formal academia and for the rest of his life conducted seminars on his own.

From among a large number of very important publications, his two most important are On Essence (1963) and the three-volume work, Sentient Intelligence (1980-83). Ellacuría, who knew all of Zubiri's work, was particularly familiar with these two works: his doctoral dissertation was on the former, and he worked very closely with Zubiri to bring the latter to publication before Zubiri's death.

Zubiri created a systematic philosophy grounded in a re-configuring and overcoming of the distinction between epistemology and metaphysics, between the knower and the known (for more, see the section below on Ellacuría's philosophy). There are now various interpretations of Zubiri's work (among others, phenomenological, Nietzschean, praxical) with Ellacuría heading up the historical/metaphysical interpretation. Although there is no agreement among Zubirian scholars as to which among these is the better interpretation, the fact that Zubiri adopted Ellacuría as his closest collaborator for the last 20 years of his life has to lend some weight to Ellacuría's interpretation

Ellacuría was murdered in 1989 - along with five other Jesuits with whom he lived, their housekeeper and her daughter – at the hands of an elite, US-trained squadron of the Salvadoran army. The murders came towards the end of El Salvador's long civil war (1980-1992) between a right-wing government and leftist guerillas. At the time of his death, Ellacuría was president of the country's prestigious Jesuit university, the University of Central America (UCA), as well as chair of its philosophy department and editor of many of its scholarly publications. In his quarter century with the UCA, the last ten years as its president, he had played a principle role in molding it into a university whose full institutional power - that is, through its research, teaching and publications - was directed towards uncovering the causes of poverty and oppression in El Salvador. In addition, he spoke out frequently on these topics as a regular contributor to the country's newspapers, radio and television programs. He also addressed these topics frequently in his scholarly publications on philosophy and theology. These were the reasons behind his murder.

During his lifetime Ellacuría was known, primarily, as one of the principle contributors to Latin American liberation theology. However, he also spent the last two decades of his life elaborating a liberation philosophy. The latter work was left, at the time of his murder, unfinished, unpublished, and scattered across many different writings. In the years since his death, a number of scholars have pieced together his philosophical thought, and it is now possible to argue that Ellacuría had a well-developed philosophy that represents an important contribution to Latin American liberation philosophy.

2. Ellacuría's Philosophy of Liberation

Ellacuría argued that philosophy, in order to remain true to itself, must be a philosophy of liberation. He begins with the assertion that it is the responsibility of philosophy to help us in figuring out what reality is and in situating ourselves within reality. For Ellacuría, human reality is historical and social: the range of possibilities in which the freedom of any given individual's life must be exercised is the result of both past human actions and the society in which the individual lives. Human actions accrete as history, and within this reality individuals and societies are able to realize some of the possibilities handed over by the past, in the process creating new possibilities to hand over to future generations. There is progress in reality, from the physical to the biological to the praxical, each of these representing a further unfolding of an ever more complex reality. In the realm of praxis (his word for human action to change reality), human beings act to realize a wider range of possibility: praxis seeks to realize a fuller praxis. Thus, praxis realizes a gradual increase in liberty: praxis gradually liberates liberty.

Human beings, as praxical beings, are responsible for the further unfolding of reality, i.e., for the realization of a reality in which all praxical beings can fully realize themselves as such. Ellacuría argues that the vantage point from which one can see most clearly what reality unfolding as history has and has not delivered, is the perspective of the marginalized. Thus, the philosophy of history must make a preferential option for the marginalized, i.e., it must be a philosophy of liberation.

Ellacuría's liberation philosophy begins with a critique grounded in a Zubirian metaphysics that is radically critical of all forms of idealism, including most of what has passed for realism in the history of Western philosophy. This critique argues that the Western tradition made a fundamental error, from Parmenides on, in separating sensation and the intellect, an error which distorted all subsequent philosophy. This error resulted in the "logification of intelligence" and the “entification of reality.” By the former, Zubiri means that the full powers of the intellect have been reduced to a predicative logos, i.e., a logos whose function is to determine what things are, in themselves and in relation to other things. Zubiri argues that while this is a vital part of intelligence, it is not the only part and not the most fundamental part, but Western philosophy reduced intelligence to this predicative logos. In doing so, the object of logos, i.e., the being of entities, became the sum total of reality: reality became entified. These two distortions (the logification of intelligence and entification of reality) can only be overcome by the recognition that sensation and intellection are not separate, that they are two aspects of a single faculty. Zubiri called this faculty the sentient intellect. By this term he meant that, for human beings, the intellect is always sentient and sensation is always intelligent. The two faculties of sensation and intelligence are, for human beings, one and the same faculty. This new, human faculty, the "sentient intellect," is Zubiri's candidate for the specific difference of human beings as a species: a new type of sensation that is essentially different from the sense faculty of other animals, different by the addition of intelligence.

In what way is human sensation essentially different than the sensation of other animals? For Zubiri, part of every human sensation, but absent in animal sensation, is the awareness that the object sensed is real, i.e., that it is has the property of being something in and of itself, independent from me, that it is not a willful extension of me. This recognition of the real as real is the fundamental act of the intelligence; it is the intellectual act that is part and parcel, structurally, inextricably, of every act of human sensation. Thus, through the unitary faculty of the sentient intellect we apprehend reality as real. The consequence of this is that we are always already installed in reality. There is no question about how the mind reaches what is real, no need to build a bridge between the mind and reality.

The intellect, like the rest of the body, evolved as a response to challenges posed by the environment. Animals respond to stimuli while humans are confronted with possible realities. Animals are faced with a predetermined cast of responses to a given stimuli. But human beings in any given situation have an open spectrum of options from among which we must choose. We are, in effect, faced with the possibilities of many different realities, and our choices contribute to the determination of reality as it is realized; thus the name that Zubiri gives to human beings: the "reality animal." The openness of the options facing us is the structural basis of our freedom. Freedom is not something mysterious but a result of the evolutionary pressures that lead to the emergence of a sentient intelligence. The evolutionary niche occupied by human beings is one in which the cast of responses to a stimulus grew to the point where there was no longer anything automatic about which possible response would be enacted. Our niche is the one where the huge number of possible responses opened up different potential realities, allowing us more fully to exploit reality's possibilities. In other words, our niche is precisely the freedom to choose from among the huge number of possible responses, i.e., from among the huge number of possible realities. To manage this operation of choosing, animal sensation evolved into the sentient intellect.

So, according to Zubirian metaphysics, human beings are always already installed in reality as the part of reality whose actions determine future reality: humans are the part of reality that now unfolds further reality. In previous eras, the unfolding of reality took place by physical and biological forces, but now it is human forces (praxis) that unfolds reality. This is not to say that physical and biological forces are no longer present. They are present, and continue to form the foundation of praxis, but praxis outstrips them. An authentic praxis, however, must recognize its foundation in biology and physics - that is why the physical and biological needs of human beings must be met in order for the fullness of human praxis to be realizable. Thus, an authentic praxis must strive for a reality in which the physical and biological needs of all humans are met.

Ellacuría concludes from all of this that the primary question facing human beings - metaphysical and ethical at once – is: given that we are always already in reality, what is the proper way to engage it? Ellacuría characterizes Zubiri's intellectual motto as "to come as close as possible, intellectually, to the reality of things." Western philosophy “had not found an adequate way to shoulder responsibility for reality [hacerse cargo de la realidad]." The search for the right way to engage reality was the motivation for Ellacuría's work. For Ellacuría, humans are now shouldered with responsibility for reality in the sense of being charged with the task of figuring out what is the proper way of exercising the fundamental freedom opened up by the advent, within evolution, of the sentient intellect. In this sense, human beings are the responsible part of reality, i.e., the part of reality whose task it is to figure out how to respond to reality thereby creating a new reality unfolded out of the previous reality. In order for humans to properly exercise this responsibility, we must discern the direction in which reality needs to be taken.

The sentient intellect evolved to enable us to act more effectively in insuring our own survival. This is not selfish, as it may at first sound, given the element of responsibility that comes along with the sentient intellect. As the reality animal, our actions decide between various possible future realities. Thus, as the responsible part of reality, we are now charged with assisting in the further realization of reality. Ellacuría gives the special name of "praxis" to this action that determines reality.

If we look at the development of reality, we can discern a progression from matter, to life, to human life. This progression has been under the control of, first, physical forces, then biological forces, and now, with the evolution of the being with sentient intelligence, the progressive unfolding of reality is subject to the force of praxis. Thus there is a gradual liberation of more developed forces. Subsequent forces do not erase the earlier ones, but rather subsume them dialectically. Thus, human praxis cannot ignore the physical and biological needs of reality: these are the imperatives that must be satisfied on the way to the full realization of praxis itself. Reality has delivered, liberated, successively more developed forces, each layered over the previous: the biological on top of the physical, and the praxical on top of the biological. The direction of this process can be seen: praxis is the most advanced force reality has developed, and praxis must now take its place as the force that most drives the further unfolding of reality (just as physical and biological forces had, successively, taken that place previously). Since the essence of praxis is freedom, human beings must now exercise our freedom such that we further the proper development of reality. To remain true to our essence, and true to the essence of reality, we must act so as to further the development, the spread, of praxis. Thus, the direction of this process of liberation is the liberation of liberty itself, a process for which the reality animal, the praxical being, is responsible. Thus the full realization of reality entails this: praxical beings acting to bring about the realization of the reality in which all praxical beings (that is, all human beings) can realize the fullness of their praxical essence. In other words, physical and biological forces brought about human beings; but the nature of human beings is such that we are now responsible for the further and fuller realization of reality, which realization is precisely the liberation of all human beings such that they can realize the fullness of their essence. Thus Ellacuría is able to argue that the metaphysics of reality demands a liberatory praxis from us: liberation, because of the essence of human beings and the nature of reality, is a metaphysical imperative.

We can begin to see the prescriptions that emerge from the foregoing analysis. Ellacuría's liberation philosophy allows him to argue that the essence of being human demands that society be structured in such a way as to meet the physical and biological needs of human beings at an adequate level, i.e., a level that frees us to pursue our essence as praxical beings. Further, his analysis suggests that it is the duty of those of us who enjoy a wider exercise of freedom to dedicate our talents and efforts towards the construction of such a society: our essence as the leading edge of reality that is now responsible for the further unfolding of reality demands that we assist in the establishment of a reality in which praxis is more fully realized, i.e., a reality in which more people (ultimately, all people) are freed from basic wants (inflicted on them by poverty) so that they can exercise their praxis. In other words, the full self-realization of the privileged lies in their enlisting themselves in the struggles of the oppressed. This does not mean that the privileged have to become oppressed. Rather, it means that they should use the education and power delivered to them by their socially and historically conditioned privilege to further the struggles of the oppressed. Note that this is not paternalistic. The struggles of the oppressed represent the leading edge of reality's further development. The endeavors of the privileged apart from these struggles represent dead-end dilly-dallying (no matter how important they seem to those engaged in them) that does not further the humanization of reality and, thus, will not become an enduring part of human history. Far from paternalism, what saves the privileged from the meaningless pursuits with which they are wont to fill their time, and thus from a meaningless life, is the decision to lend their efforts to further the cause of the oppressed.

Thus, with Zubirian realism and in creative dialogue with Marx, Ellacuría undertook, from the perspective of the poor of the Third World, the project of forging a philosophy that recognized the material nature of being human - and thus the need to take into account the structures of poverty and oppression - while holding open the possibility of a transcendent realm, a realm one and the same with the material realm (actually part of the material realm) in which can exist human freedom and perhaps even God. Ellacuría was constructing a liberation philosophy in the service of the concrete needs of the Latin American people and of the Third World in general. It is a project in the service of which Ellacuría took great strides, but which remained unfinished at his death.

3. References and Further Reading

There still remain a number of unpublished pieces that are important to Ellacuría's liberation philosophy. These consist primarily of extensive notes he took for the courses he taught at the UCA. These, and all of Ellacuría's published and unpublished writings, are located in the Ignacio Ellacuría Archives at the Universidad Centroamericana (UCA) in San Salvador, El Salvador.

  • Burke, Kevin (2000). The Ground Beneath the Cross: The Theology of Ignacio Ellacuría, Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press.
    • In English, this book contains good chapters (chs. 2-4) on the philosophical foundation of Ellacuría's theological thought.
  • Cerutti, Horacio (1992). La Filosofia de la Liberación Latinoamericana, Mexico City: FCE.
    • The best overview of Latin American liberation philosophy, though the book was written before Ellacuría's contributions to the topic were widely known. Thus, Cerutti charts four main currents of Latin American liberation philosophy. Ellacuría's contributions represent a fifth current.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (2000-2002). Escritos Teológicos [ET], four volumes, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Some philosophically important pieces are also collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1996-2001). Escritos Filosóficos [EF], three volumes, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • His scores of important philosophical essays have been collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1999). Escritos Universitarios [EU], San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Some philosophically important pieces are also collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1993). Veinte Años de Historia en El Salvador: Escritos Políticos [VA], three volumes, second edition, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Some philosophically important pieces are also collected here.
  • Ellacuría, Ignacio (1990). Filosofía de la Realidad Histórica, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • Ellacuría's main philosophical work. This 600-page book was written and revised a couple of times in the early 1970s. It was never finished (there are indications in his notes that he intended to write more chapters) but it is fairly polished and the best indication of the scope and force of his argument for liberation philosophy.
  • Hassett, John & Hugh Lacey, eds. (1991). Towards a Society that Serves Its People: The Intellectual Contribution of El Salvador's Murdered Jesuits [TSSP], Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press.
    • English translations of eight of his essays (philosophical, theological and political).
  • Samour, Héctor (2002). Voluntad de Liberación: El Pensamiento Filosófico de Ignacio Ellacuría, San Salvador: UCA Editores.
    • The most thorough presentation of Ellacuría's philosophical thought. Samour is the scholar who has done the most to pull together, from the thousands of pages of unpublished and published material, Ellacuría's liberation philosophy and this comprehensive book is the result of his labors.
  • Whitfield, Teresa (1995). Paying the Price: Ignacio Ellacuría and the Murdered Jesuits of El Salvador, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
    • The best intellectual biography on Ellacuría.

From among all of the collected essays, the most important for understanding Ellacuría's liberation philosophy are the following:

  • "Filosofía y Política" [1972], VA-1, pp. 47-62.
  • "Liberación: Misión y Carisma de la Iglesia" [1973], ET-2, pp. 553-584.
  • "Diez Años Después: ¿Es Posible una Universidad Distinta?" [1975], EU, pp. 49-92 (an English translation is available in TSSP, pp. 177-207).
  • "Hacia una Fundamentación del Método Teológico Latinoamericana" [1975], ET-1, pp. 187-218.
  • "Filosofía, ¿Para Qué?" [1976], EF-3, pp. 115-132.
  • "Fundamentación Biológica de la Ética" [1979], EF-3, pp, 251-269.
  • "Universidad y Política" [1980], VA-1, pp. 17-46.
  • "El Objeto de la Filosofía" [1981], VA-1, pp. 63-92.
  • "Función Liberadora de la Filosofía" [1985], VA-1, pp. 93-122.
  • "La Superación del Reduccionismo Idealista en Zubiri" [1988], EF-3, pp. 403-430.
  • "El Desafío de las Mayorías Populares" (1989), EU, pp. 297-306 (an English translation is available in TSSP, pp. 171-176).
  • "En Torno al Concepto y a la Idea de Liberación" [1989], ET-1, pp. 629-657.
  • "Utopía y Profetismo en América Latina" [1989], ET-2, pp. 233-294 (an English translation is available in TSSP, pp. 44-88).

Author Information

David I. Gandolfo
Email: david.gandolfo@furman.edu
Furman University
U. S. A.

Nikolai Fedorovich Fedorov (1829—1903)

FedorovFedorov's thoughts have been variously described as bold, culminating, curious, easily-misunderstood, extreme, hazy, idealist, naive, of-value, scientifico-magical, special, unexpected, unique, and utopian. Many of the small number of philosophers familiar with Fedorov admit his originality, his independence, his human concern, perhaps even his logic -- up to a point. But his resurrection project is viewed with understandable skepticism and often dismissed as an impossible fantasy. Interestingly, the harshest criticism has come from Christian thinkers such as Florovsky and Ustryalov whose objections bear religious overtones; some materialists such as Muravyov and Setnitsky have been quite benign and favorable by comparison. Perhaps all would agree, however, on Fedorov's single-mindedness. Looked at positively, this is simply another term for purity-of-heart, a quality of saintliness. With his strong emphasis on kinship and brotherhood demanding, ultimately, a world in which all must mutually benefit, Fedorov perhaps anticipates Rawls who says: "Thus what we are doing is to combine into one conception the totality of conditions that we are ready upon due reflection to recognize as reasonable in our conduct with regard to one another. ... all persons ... even ... persons who are not contemporaries but who belong to many generations. Thus to see our place in society from the perspective of this position is ... to regard the human situation not only from all social but also from all temporal points of view. The perspective of eternity is not a perspective from a certain place beyond the world, nor the point of view of a transcendent being; rather it is a certain form of thought and feeling that rational persons can adopt within the world. ... Purity of heart, if one could attain it, would be to see clearly and to act with grace and self-command from this point of view." Fedorov wrote: "By refusing to grant ourselves the right to set ourselves apart ... we are kept from setting any goal for ourselves that is not the common task of all." But Fedorov's thought soars beyond the present world to a world of its own, in his insistence that we can become immortal and godlike through rational efforts, and that our moral obligation is to create a heaven to be shared by all who ever lived.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
  3. Further Reading

1. Life

Russian philosopher, teacher, and librarian Nikolai Fedorovich Fedorov was born June 9, 1829, and died December 28, 1903. He was founder of an immortalist (anti-death) philosophy emphasizing "the common task" of resurrecting the dead through scientific means. Since the end of the Cold War, his thought has received renewed interest and advocacy in Russia and elsewhere -- for example, in connection with cryonics (cryonic hibernation) and prolongevity. Nikolai Fedorovich Fedorov (alternative romanized spellings are possible -- for example: Nicholas Fyodorovich Fyodorov) advocated the ethical priority of a research and development project he called "the common task," by which he meant the universal physical resurrection of the dead by future advances in science and technology. He was highly praised by such people as Fyodor Dostoevsky and Leo Tolstoy (literature), Afanasi Fet (poetry), and Konstantin Tsiolkowsky (astronautics), yet he is not well known in the West, despite some limited interest. The illegitimate son of Prince Pavel Ivanovich Gagarin and Elisaveta Ivanova, a woman of lower-class nobility, Nikolai (with his mother and her other children) had to leave his father's home at age four, due to the prince's death. The family continued to be well cared for, however. Beginning in 1868, he worked for 25 years as a librarian with the Rumiantsev Museum (now the Russian State Library), Moscow; during this period, he was teacher-mentor of the young Konstantin Tsiolkowsky. After retiring, and until his death, he worked in the Archives of the Ministry of Foreign Affairs. His works, published posthumously, were available (in accordance with the Christian spirit of Fedorov's philosophy) only free of charge from the publisher, who renounced all rights.

2. Philosophy

Due to his Christian perspective, Fedorov found the widespread lack of love among people appalling. He divided these non-loving relations into two kinds. One is alienation among people: "non-kindred relations of people among themselves." The other is isolation of the living from the dead: "nature's non-kindred relation to men." "[O]ne should live not for oneself nor for others but with all and for all" (Filosofiya Obshchago Dela vol. I, 118, n. 5, as quoted in Zakydalsky, 55). Fedorov is referring to all people of all time (past, present, future). He is speaking of a project to unite humankind, the colonization ("spiritualization") of the universe, the quest for the Kingdom of God, the creation of cosmos from chaos, the death of death, even resurrection of the dead. Fedorov believed, and passionately felt, that resignation in the face of death and separation of knowledge from action was false Christianity. He cautioned against being fooled into worshipping the blind forces of Satan. Rather, one should actively participate in changing what is into what ought to be.

The division between the learned and the unlearned was, in Fedorov's view, worse than the separation of the rich and the poor. The unlearned are more concerned with work than thought. The learned (philosophers and scientists) are less concerned with work than thought. The learned seem unaware that ideas "are not subjective, nor are they objective; they are projective." Philosophers and scientists, because they have separated ideas from moral action, are simply slaves to the imperfect present order. It is a root dogma of the learned that paradise is not possible. The unlearned should demand that the learned (because only they have the necessary knowledge) become a temporary task force for the Kingdom of God. The learned, however, will attempt to persuade us that problems like crop failures, disease, and death are not general questions but matters for a narrow discipline, questions for only a very small (or nonexistent) minority of the learned. Separation of the learned from the masses turns them into a seemingly permanent class, producing non-lovers of humankind. The "transformation of the blind course of nature into one that is rational ... is bound to appear to the learned as a disruption of order, although this order of theirs brings only disorder among men, striking them down with famine, plague, and death."

A citizen, a comrade, or a team-member can be replaced by another. However a person loved, one's kin, is irreplaceable. Moreover, memory of one's dead kin is not the same as the real person. Pride in one's forefathers is a vice, a form of egotism. On the other hand, love of one's forefathers means sadness in their death, requiring the literal raising of the dead. Politics must be replaced by physics. The politics of egoism and altruism must be replaced by Christianity which "knows only all men." Pride is a Tower of Babel that separates us from one another. Love is a "fusion as opposed to a confusion." For Fedorov, "complete and universal salvation" is preferable to "incomplete or non-universal salvation in which some men -- the sinners -- are condemned to eternal torments and others -- the righteous -- to an eternal contemplation of these torments." That is to say, Fedorov's bold science project, "the common task," is not the only possible route to salvation. "Salvation may also occur without the participation of men ... if they do not unite in the common task"; "if we do not unite to accomplish our salvation, if we do not accept the Gospel message," then a "purely transcendent resurrection will save only the elect; for the rest it will be an expression of God's wrath," "eternal punishment." "I believe this literally." "Christianity has not fully saved the world, because it has not been fully assimilated." Christianity "is not simply a doctrine of redemption, but the very task of redemption."

Fedorov's thoughts have been variously described as bold, culminating, curious, easily-misunderstood, extreme, hazy, idealist, naive, of-value, scientifico-magical, special, unexpected, unique, and utopian. Many of the small number of philosophers familiar with Fedorov admit his originality, his independence, his human concern, perhaps even his logic -- up to a point. But his resurrection project is viewed with understandable skepticism and often dismissed as an impossible fantasy. Interestingly, the harshest criticism has come from Christian thinkers such as Florovsky and Ustryalov whose objections bear religious overtones; some materialists such as Muravyov and Setnitsky have been quite benign and favorable by comparison. Perhaps all would agree, however, on Fedorov's single-mindedness. Looked at positively, this is simply another term for purity-of-heart, a quality of saintliness. With his strong emphasis on kinship and brotherhood demanding, ultimately, a world in which all must mutually benefit, Fedorov perhaps anticipates Rawls who says: "Thus what we are doing is to combine into one conception the totality of conditions that we are ready upon due reflection to recognize as reasonable in our conduct with regard to one another. ... all persons ... even ... persons who are not contemporaries but who belong to many generations. Thus to see our place in society from the perspective of this position is ... to regard the human situation not only from all social but also from all temporal points of view. The perspective of eternity is not a perspective from a certain place beyond the world, nor the point of view of a transcendent being; rather it is a certain form of thought and feeling that rational persons can adopt within the world. ... Purity of heart, if one could attain it, would be to see clearly and to act with grace and self-command from this point of view." Fedorov wrote: "By refusing to grant ourselves the right to set ourselves apart ... we are kept from setting any goal for ourselves that is not the common task of all." But Fedorov's thought soars beyond the present world to a world of its own, in his insistence that we can become immortal and godlike through rational efforts, and that our moral obligation is to create a heaven to be shared by all who ever lived. "[D]eath is merely the result or manifestation of our infantilism, lack of independence and self-reliance, and of our incapacity for mutual support and the restoration of life. People are still minors, half-beings, whereas the fullness of personal existence, personal perfection, is possible. However, it is possible only within general perfection. Coming of age will bring perfect health and immortality, but for the living [living contemporaries of Fedorov] immortality is impossible without the resurrection of the dead"(What Was Man Created For?, 76).

3. Further Reading

(Collected Works in Russian)

  • Fedorov, N. F. Filosofiya Obshchago Dela: Stat'i, Mysli, i Pis'ma Nikolaia Fedorovicha Fedorova, ed. V. A. Kozhevnikov and N. P. Peterson, 2 vols. originally published by Fedorov's friends and followers after his death, 1906, 1913; reprint London: Gregg Press, 1970.
  • Fedorov, N. F. Sobranie Sochineniy, 4 vols. + supp. Moscow: Traditsiya, 2000.

(Works in English)

  • Berdyaev, N. A. "N. F. Fyodorov." The Russian Review 9 (1950) 124-130.
    • Fedorov's thought was not without influence on Berdyaev's existentialism.
  • Berdyaev, N. A. The Russian Idea. New York: Macmillan Co., 1948.
    • Fedorov and other original Russian thinkers are discussed.
  • Fedorov, N. F. "The Question of Brotherhood or Kinship, of the Reasons for the Unbrotherly, Unkindred, or Unpeaceful State of the World, and of the Means for the Restoration of Kinship" in Edie, J. M.; Scanlan, J. P.; Zeldin, M.; and Kline, G. L., eds. Russian Philosophy. Chicago: Quadrangle Books, 1965. 16-54.
    • This is one place to begin if you want to read Fedorov directly (in English translation).
  • Fedorov, N. F. What Was Man Created For? The Philosophy of the Common Task: Selected Works. Koutiassov, E.; and Minto, M., eds. Lausanne, Switzerland: Honeyglen/L'Age d'Homme, 1990.
    • A good source of Fedorov in English translation; includes a list of Russian language works in the bibliography.
  • Lossky, N. O. History of Russian Philosophy. New York: International Universities Press, 1951.
    • Fedorov is included in this history.
  • Lukashevich, S. N. F. Fedorov (1828-1903): A Study in Russian Eupsychian and Utopian Thought. Newark: University of Delaware Press, 1977.
    • The methodology used in this study may not insure full appreciation of Fedorov's thought, but it does demonstrate that his thought was indeed a detailed, coherent philosophy in which the various pieces fit together.
  • Schmemann, A., ed. Ultimate Questions: An Anthology of Modern Russian Religious Thought. New York: Holt, Rinehart and Winston, 1965; reprint Crestwood, NY: St. Vladimir's Seminary Press, 1977.
    • Selections (translations) from Russian religious thinkers, including Fedorov, concerned with eschatology or other "ultimate" questions. The Fedorov material is from vol. 1 of Filosofiya Obshchago Dela and deals with "the restoration of kinship among mankind."
  • Soloviov, M. "The 'Russian Trace' in the History of Cryonics," Cryonics 16:4 (4th Quarter, 1995) 20-23.
    • Closing paragraph describes author's then-current (post-cold-war) and perhaps unprecedented efforts promoting cryonics and immortalism in the former Soviet Union; the article itself acknowledges a debt to Fedorov.
  • Young, G. M. Nikolai F. Fedorov: An Introduction. Belmont, Mass.: Nordland Publishing Co., 1979.
    • Not only an excellent introduction, but a mine of references and information inviting further Fedorovian research, including Russian language works, many of which are not yet translated (or not fully translated) into English.
  • Zakydalsky, T. D. N. F. Fyodorov's Philosophy of Physical Resurrection. Ann Arbor, Mich.: UMI, 1976.
    • A Ph.D. dissertation (Bryn Mawr) of 531 pages. Bibliography has a list of Russian language works.
  • Zenkovsky, V. V. A History of Russian Philosophy. New York: Columbia University Press, 1953.
    • Fedorov is included in this history.

Author Information

Charles Tandy
Email: cetandy@gmail.com
Ria University
U. S. A.

R. Michael Perry
Email: mike@alcor.org
U. S. A.

Gottlob Frege (1848—1925)

FregeGottlob Frege was a German logician, mathematician and philosopher who played a crucial role in the emergence of modern logic and analytic philosophy. Frege's logical works were revolutionary, and are often taken to represent the fundamental break between contemporary approaches and the older, Aristotelian tradition. He invented modern quantificational logic, and created the first fully axiomatic system for logic, which was complete in its treatment of propositional and first-order logic, and also represented the first treatment of higher-order logic. In the philosophy of mathematics, he was one of the most ardent proponents of logicism, the thesis that mathematical truths are logical truths, and presented influential criticisms of rival views such as psychologism and formalism. His theory of meaning, especially his distinction between the sense and reference of linguistic expressions, was groundbreaking in semantics and the philosophy of language. He had a profound and direct influence on such thinkers as Russell, Carnap and Wittgenstein. Frege is often called the founder of modern logic, and he is sometimes even heralded as the founder of analytic philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Contributions to Logic
  3. Contributions to the Philosophy of Mathematics
  4. The Theory of Sense and Reference
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Frege's Own Works
    2. Important Secondary Works

1. Life and Works

Frege was born on November 8, 1848 in the coastal city of Wismar in Northern Germany. His full christened name was Friedrich Ludwig Gottlob Frege. Little is known about his youth. His father, Karl Alexander Frege, and his mother, Auguste (Bialloblotzsky) Frege, both worked at a girl's private school founded in part by Karl. Both were also principals of the school at various points: Karl held the position until his death 1866, when Auguste took over until her death in 1878. The German writer Arnold Frege, born in Wismar in 1852, may have been Frege's younger brother, but this has not been confirmed. Frege probably lived in Wismar until 1869; in the years from 1864-1869 he is known to have studied at the Gymnasium in Wismar.

In Spring 1869, Frege began studies at the University of Jena. There, he studied chemistry, philosophy and mathematics, and must have solidly impressed Ernst Abbe in mathematics, who later become of Frege's benefactors. After four semesters, Frege transferred to the University of Göttingen, where he studied mathematics and physics, as well as philosophy of religion under Hermann Lotze. (Lotze is sometimes thought to have had a profound impact on Frege's philosophical views.) In late 1873, Frege finished his doctoral dissertation, under the guidance of Ernst Schering, entitled Über eine geometrische Darstellung der imaginären Gebilde in der Ebene ("On a Geometrical Representation of Imaginary Figures in a Plane"), and received his Ph.D.

In 1874, with the recommendation of Ernst Abbe, Frege received a lectureship at the University of Jena, where he stayed the rest of his intellectual life. His position was unsalaried during his first five years, and he was supported by his mother. Frege's Habilitationsschrift, entitled Rechnungsmethoden, die auf eine Erweiterung des Grössenbegriffes gründen ("Methods of Calculation Based upon An Amplification of the Concept of Magnitude,"), was included with the material submitted to obtain the position. It involves the theory of complex mathematical functions, and contains seeds of Frege's advances in logic and the philosophy of mathematics.

Frege had a heavy teaching load during his first few years at Jena. However, he still had time to work on his first major work in logic, which was published in 1879 under the title Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens ("Concept-Script: A Formula Language for Pure Thought Modeled on That of Arithmetic"). Therein, Frege presented for the first time his invention of a new method for the construction of a logical language. Upon the publication of the Begriffsschrift, he was promoted to ausserordentlicher Professor, his first salaried position. However, the book was not well-reviewed by Frege's contemporaries, who apparently found its two-dimensional logical notation difficult to comprehend, and failed to see its advantages over previous approaches, such as that of Boole.

Sometime after the publication of the Begriffsschrift, Frege was married to Margaret Lieseburg (1856-1905). They had at least two children, who unfortunately died young. Years later they adopted a son, Alfred. However, little else is known about Frege's family life.

Frege had aimed to use the logical language of the Begriffsschrift to carry out his logicist program of attempting to show that all of the basic truths of arithmetic could be derived from purely logical axioms. However, on the advice of Carl Stumpf, and given the poor reception of the Begriffsschrift, Frege decided to write a work in which he would describe his logicist views informally in ordinary language, and argue against rival views. The result was his Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik ("The Foundations of Arithmetic"), published in 1884. However, this work seems to have been virtually ignored by most of Frege's contemporaries.

Soon thereafter, Frege began working on his attempt to derive the basic laws of arithmetic within his logical language. However, his work was interrupted by changes to his views. In the late 1880s and early 1890s Frege developed new and interesting theories regarding the nature of language, functions and concepts, and philosophical logic, including a novel theory of meaning based on the distinction between sense and reference. These views were published in influential articles such as "Funktion und Begriff" ("Function and Concept", 1891), "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" ("On Sense and Reference", 1892) and "Über Begriff und Gegenstand" ("On Concept and Object", 1892). This maturation of Frege's semantic and philosophical views lead to changes in his logical language, forcing him to abandon an almost completed draft of his work in logic and the foundations of mathematics. However, in 1893, Frege finally finished a revised volume, employing a slightly revised logical system. This was his magnum opus, Grundgesetze der Arithmetik ("Basic Laws of Arithmetic"), volume I. In the first volume, Frege presented his new logical language, and proceeded to use it to define the natural numbers and their properties. His aim was to make this the first of a three volume work; in the second and third, he would move on to the definition of real numbers, and the demonstration of their properties.

Again, however, Frege's work was unfavorably reviewed by his contemporaries. Nevertheless, he was promoted once again in 1894, now to the position of Honorary Ordinary Professor. It is likely that Frege was offered a position as full Professor, but turned it down to avoid taking on additional administrative duties. His new position was unsalaried, but he was able to support himself and his family with a stipend from the Carl Zeiss Stiftung, a foundation that gave money to the University of Jena, and with which Ernst Abbe was intimately involved.

Because of the unfavorable reception of his earlier works, Frege was forced to arrange to have volume II of the Grundgesetze published at his own expense. It was not until 1902 that Frege was able to make such arrangements. However, while the volume was already in the publication process, Frege received a letter from Bertrand Russell, informing him that it was possible to prove a contradiction in the logical system of the first volume of the Grundgesetze, which included a naive calculus for classes. For more information, see the article on "Russell's Paradox". Frege was, in his own words, "thunderstruck". He was forced to quickly prepare an appendix in response. For the next couple years, he continued to do important work. A series of articles entitled "Über die Grundlagen der Geometrie," ("On the Foundations of Geometry") was published between 1903 and 1906, representing Frege's side of a debate with David Hilbert over the nature of geometry and the proper construction and understanding of axiomatic systems within mathematics.

However, around 1906, probably due to some combination of poor health, the early loss of his wife in 1905, frustration with his failure to find an adequate solution to Russell's paradox, and disappointment over the continued poor reception of his work, Frege seems to have lost his intellectual steam. He produced very little work between 1906 and his retirement in 1918. However, he continued to influence others during this period. Russell had included an appendix on Frege in his 1903 Principles of Mathematics. It is from this that Frege came be to be a bit wider known, including to an Austrian student studying engineering in Manchester, England, named Ludwig Wittgenstein. Wittgenstein studied the work of Frege and Russell closely, and in 1911, he wrote to both of them concerning his own solution to Russell's paradox. Frege invited him to Jena to discuss his views. Wittgenstein did so in late 1911. The two engaged in a philosophical debate, and while Wittgenstein reported that Frege "wiped the floor" with him, Frege was sufficiently impressed with Wittgenstein that he suggested that he go to Cambridge to study with Russell--a suggestion that had profound importance for the history of philosophy. Moreover, Rudolf Carnap was one of Frege's students from 1910 to 1913, and doubtlessly Frege had significant influence on Carnap's interest in logic and semantics and his subsequent intellectual development and successes.

After his retirement in 1918, Frege moved to Bad Kleinen, near Wismar, and managed to publish a number of important articles, "Der Gedanke" ("The Thought", 1918), "Der Verneinung" ("Negation", 1918), and "Gedankengefüge" ("Compound Thoughts", 1923). However, these were not wholly new works, but later drafts of works he had initiated in the 1890s. In 1924, a year before his death, Frege finally returned to the attempt to understand the foundations of arithmetic. However, by this time, he had completely given up on his logicism, concluding that the paradoxes of class or set theory made it impossible. He instead attempted to develop a new theory of the nature of arithmetic based on Kantian pure intuitions of space. However, he was not able to write much or publish anything about his new theory. Frege died on July 26, 1925 at the age of 76.

At the time of his death, Frege's own works were still not very widely known. He did not live to see the profound impact he would have on the emergence of analytic philosophy, nor to see his brand of logic--due to the championship of Russell--virtually wholly supersede earlier forms of logic. However, in bequeathing his unpublished work to his adopted son, Alfred, he wrote prophetically, "I believe there are things here which will one day be prized much more highly than they are now. Take care that nothing gets lost." Alfred later gave Frege's papers to Heinrich Scholz of the University of Münster for safekeeping. Unfortunately, however, they were destroyed in an Allied bombing raid on March 25, 1945. Although Scholz had made copies of some of the more important pieces, a good portion of Frege's unpublished works were lost.

Although he was a fierce, sometimes even satirical, polemicist, Frege himself was a quiet, reserved man. He was right-wing in his political views, and like many conservatives of his generation in Germany, he is known to have been distrustful of foreigners and rather anti-semitic. Himself Lutheran, Frege seems to have wanted to see all Jews expelled from Germany, or at least deprived of certain political rights. This distasteful feature of Frege's personality has gravely disappointed some of Frege's intellectual progeny.

2. Contributions to Logic

Trained as a mathematician, Frege's interests in logic grew out of his interests in the foundations of arithmetic. Early in his career, Frege became convinced that the truths of arithmetic are logical, analytic truths, agreeing with Leibniz, and disagreeing with Kant, who thought that arithmetical knowledge was grounded in "pure intuition", as well as more empiricist thinkers such as J. S. Mill, who thought that arithmetic was grounded in observation. In other words, Frege subscribed to logicism. His logicism was modest in one sense, but very ambitious in others. Frege's logicism was limited to arithmetic; unlike other important historical logicists, such as Russell, Frege did not think that geometry was a branch of logic. However, Frege's logicism was very ambitious in another regard, as he believed that one could prove all of the truths of arithmetic deductively from a limited number of logical axioms. Indeed, Frege himself set out to demonstrate all of the basic laws of arithmetic within his own system of logic.

Frege concurred with Leibniz that natural language was unsuited to such a task. Thus, Frege sought to create a language that would combine the tasks of what Leibniz called a "calculus ratiocinator" and "lingua characterica", that is, a logically perspicuous language in which logical relations and possible inferences would be clear and unambiguous. Frege's own term for such a language, "Begriffsschrift" was likely borrowed from a paper on Leibniz's ideas written by Adolf Trendelenburg. Although there had been attempts to fashion at least the core of such a language made by Boole and others working in the Leibnizian tradition, Frege found their work unsuitable for a number of reasons. Boole's logic used some of the same signs used in mathematics, except with different logical meanings. Frege found this unacceptable for a language which was to be used to demonstrate mathematical truths, because the signs would be ambiguous. Boole's logic, though innovative in some respects, was weak in others. It was divided into a "primary logic" and "secondary logic", bifurcating its propositional and categorical elements, and could not deal adequately with multiple generalities. It analyzed propositions in terms of subject and predicate concepts, which Frege found to be imprecise and antiquated.

Frege saw the formulae of mathematics as the paradigm of clear, unambiguous writing. Frege's brand of logical language was modeled upon the international language of arithmetic, and it replaced the subject/predicate style of logical analysis with the notions of function and argument. In mathematics, an equation such as "f(x) = x2 + 1" states that f is a function that takes x as argument and yields as value the result of multiplying x by itself and adding one. In order to make his logical language suitable for purposes other than arithmetic, Frege expanded the notion of function to allow arguments and values other than numbers. He defined a concept (Begriff) as a function that has a truth-value, either of the abstract objects the True or the False, as its value for any object as argument. See below for more on Frege's understanding of concepts, functions and objects. The concept being human is understood as a function that has the True as value for any argument that is human, and the False as value for anything else. Suppose that "H( )" stands for this concept, and "a" is a constant for Aristotle, and "b" is a constant for the city of Boston. Then "H(a)" stands for the True, while "H(b)" stands for the False. In Frege's terminology, an object for which a concept has the True as value is said to "fall under" the concept.

The values of such concepts could then be used as arguments to other functions. In his own logical systems, Frege introduced signs standing for the negation and conditional functions. His own logical notation was two-dimensional. However, let us instead replace Frege's own notation with more contemporary notation. For Frege, the conditional function, "→" is understood as a function the value of which is the False if its first argument is the True and the second argument is anything other than the True, and is the True otherwise. Therefore, "H(b) → H(a)" stands for the True, while "H(a) → H(b)" stands for the False. The negation sign "~" stands for a function whose value is the True for every argument except the True, for which its value is the False. Conjunction and disjunction signs could then be defined from the negation and conditional signs. Frege also introduced an identity sign, standing for a function whose value is the True if the two arguments are the same object, and the False otherwise, and a sign, which he called "the horizontal," namely "—", that stands for a function that has the True as value for the True as argument, and has the False as value for any other argument.

Variables and quantifiers are used to express generalities. Frege understands quantifiers as "second-level concepts". The distinction between levels of functions involves what kind of arguments the functions take. In Frege's view, unlike objects, all functions are "unsaturated" insofar as they require arguments to yield values. But different sorts of functions require different sorts of arguments. Functions that take objects as argument, such as those referred to by "( ) + ( )" or "H( )", are called first-level functions. Functions that take first-level functions as argument are called second-level functions. The quantifier, "∀x(...x...)", is understood as standing for a function that takes a first-level function as argument, and yields the True as value if the argument-function has the True as value for all values of x, and has the False as value otherwise. Thus, "∀xH(x)" stands for the False, since the concept H( ) does not have the True as value for all arguments. However, "∀x[H(x) → H(x)]" stands for True, since the complex concept H( ) → H( ) does have the True as value for all arguments. The existential quantifier, now written "∃x(...x...)" is defined as "~∀x~(...x...)".

Those familiar with modern predicate logic will recognize the parallels between it and Frege's logic. Frege is often credited with having founded predicate logic. However, Frege's logic is in some ways different from modern predicate logic. As we have seen, a sign such as "H( )" is a sign for a function in the strictest sense, as are the conditional and negation connectives. Frege's conditional is not, like the modern connective, something that flanks statements to form a statement. Rather, it flanks terms for truth-values to form a term for a truth-value. Frege's "H(b) → H(a)" is simply a name for the True, by itself it does not assert anything. Therefore, Frege introduces a sign he called the "judgment stroke", ⊢, used to assert that what follows it stands for the True. Thus, while "H(b) → H(a)" is simply a term for a truth-value, "⊢ H(b) → H(a)" asserts that this truth-value is the True, or in this case, that if Boston is human, then Aristotle is human. Moreover, Frege's logical system was second-order. In addition to quantifiers ranging over objects, it also contained quantifiers ranging over first-level functions. Thus, "⊢∀xF[F(x)]" asserts that every object falls under at least one concept.

Frege's logic took the form of an axiomatic system. In fact, Frege was the first to take a fully axiomatic approach to logic, and the first even to suggest that inference rules ought to be explicitly formulated and distinguished from axioms. He began with a limited number of fixed axioms, introduced explicit inference rules, and aimed to derive all other logical truths (including, for him, the truths of arithmetic) from them. Frege's first logical system, that of the 1879 Begriffsschrift, had nine axioms (one of which was not independent), one explicit inference rule, and also employed a second and third inference rule implicitly. It represented the first axiomatization of logic, and was complete in its treatment of both propositional logic and first-order quantified logic. Unlike Frege's later system, the system of the Begriffsschrift was fully consistent. (It has since been proven impossible to devise a system for higher-order logic with a finite number of axioms that is both complete and consistent.)

In order to make deduction easier, in the 1893 logical system of the Grundgesetze, Frege used fewer axioms and more inference rules: seven and twelve, respectively, this time leaving nothing implicit. The Grundgesetze also expanded upon the system of the Begriffsschrift by adding axioms governing what Frege called the "value-ranges" (Werthverlaüfe) of functions, understood as objects corresponding to the complete argument-value mappings generated by functions. In the case of concepts, their value-ranges were identified with their extensions. While Frege did sometimes also refer to the extensions of concepts as "classes", he did not conceive of such classes as aggregates or collections. They were simply understood as objects corresponding to the complete argument-value mappings generated by concepts considered as functions. Frege then introduced two axioms dealing with these value-ranges. Most infamous was his Basic Law V, which asserts that the truth-value of the value-range of function F being identical to the value-range of function G is the same as the truth-value of F and G having the same value for every argument. If one conceives of value-ranges as argument-value mappings, then this certainly seems to be a plausible hypothesis. However, from it, it is possible to prove a strong theorem of class membership: that for any object x, that object is in the extension of concept F if and only if the value of F for x as argument is the True. Given that value-ranges themselves are taken to be objects, if the concept in question is that of being a extension of a concept not included in itself, one can conclude that the extension of this concept is in itself just in case it is not. Therefore, the logical system of the Grundgesetze was inconsistent due to Russell's Paradox. See the entry on Russell's Paradox for more details. However, the core of the system of the Grundgesetze, that is, the system minus the axioms governing value-ranges, is consistent and, like the system of the Begriffsschrift, is complete in its treatment of propositional logic and first-order predicate logic.

Given the extent to which it is taken granted today, it can be difficult to fully appreciate the truly innovative and radical approach Frege took to logic. Frege was the first to attempt to transcribe the old statements of categorical logic in a language employing variables, quantifiers and truth-functions. Frege was the first to understand a statement such as "all students are hardworking" as saying roughly the same as, "for all values of x, if x is a student, then x is hardworking". This made it possible to capture the logical connection between statements such as "either all students are hardworking or all students are intelligent" and "all students are either hardworking or intelligent" (for example, that the first implies the second). In earlier logical systems such as that of Boole, in which the propositional and quantificational elements were bifurcated, the connection was wholly lost. Moreover, Frege's logical system was the first to be able to capture statements of multiple generality, such as "every person loves some city" by using multiple quantifiers in the same logical formula. This too was impossible in all earlier logical systems. Indeed, Frege's "firsts" in logic are almost too numerous to list. We have seen here that he invented modern quantification theory, presented the first complete axiomatization of propositional and first-order "predicate" logic (the latter of which he invented outright), attempted the first formulation of higher-order logic, presented the first coherent and full analysis of variables and functions, first showed it possible to reduce all truth-functions to negation and the conditional, and made the first clear distinction between axioms and inference rules in a formal system. As we shall see, he also made advances in the logic of mathematics. It is small wonder that he is often heralded as the founder of modern logic.

On Frege's "philosophy of logic", logic is made true by a realm of logical entities. Logical functions, value-ranges, and the truth-values the True and the False, are thought to be objectively real entities, existing apart from the material and mental worlds. (As we shall see below, Frege was also committed to other logical entities such as senses and thoughts.) Logical axioms are true because they express true thoughts about these entities. Thus, Frege denied the popular view that logic is without content and without metaphysical commitment. Frege was also a harsh critic of psychologism in logic: the view that logical truths are truths about psychology. While Frege believed that logic might prescribe laws about how people should think, logic is not the science of how people do think. Logical truths would remain true even if no one believed them nor used them in their reasoning. If humans were genetically designed to use regularly the so-called "inference rule" of affirming the consequent, etc., this would not make it logically valid. What is true or false, valid of invalid, does not depend on anyone's psychology or anyone's beliefs. To think otherwise is to confuse something's being true with something's being-taken-to-be-true.

3. Contributions to the Philosophy of Mathematics

Frege was an ardent proponent of logicism, the view that the truths of arithmetic are logical truths. Perhaps his most important contributions to the philosophy of mathematics were his arguments for this view. He also presented significant criticisms against rival views. We have seen that Frege was a harsh critic of psychologism in logic. He thought similarly about psychologism in mathematics. Numbers cannot be equated with anyone's mental images, nor truths of mathematics with psychological truths. Mathematical truths are objective, not subjective. Frege was also a critic of Mill's view that arithmetical truths are empirical truths, based on observation. Frege pointed out that it is not just observable things that can be counted, and that mathematical truths seem to apply also to these things. On Mill's view, numbers must be taken to be conglomerations of objects. Frege rejects this view for a number of reasons. Firstly, is one conglomeration of two things the same as a different conglomeration of two things, and if not, in what sense are they equal? Secondly, a conglomeration can be seen as made up of a different number of things, depending on how the parts are counted. One deck of cards contains fifty two cards, but each card consists of a multitude of atoms. There is no one uniquely determined "number" of the whole conglomeration. He also reiterated the arguments of others: that mathematical truths seem apodictic and knowable a priori. He also argued against the Kantian view that arithmetic truths are based on the pure intuition of the succession of time. His main argument against this view, however, was simply his own work in which he showed that truths about the nature of succession and sequence can be proven purely from the axioms of logic.

Frege was also an opponent of formalism, the view that arithmetic can be understood as the study of uninterpreted formal systems. While Frege's logical language represented a kind of formal system, he insisted that his formal system was important only because of what its signs represent and its propositions mean. The signs themselves, independently of what they mean, are unimportant. To suggest that mathematics is the study simply of the formal system, is, in Frege's eyes, to confuse the sign and thing signified. To suggest that arithmetic is the study of formal systems also suggests, absurdly, that the formula "5 + 7 = 12", written in Arabic numerals, is not the same truth as the formula, "V + VII = XII", written in Roman numerals. Frege suggests also that this confusion would have the absurd result that numbers simply are the numerals, the signs on the page, and that we should be able to study their properties with a microscope.

Frege suggests that rival views are often the result of attempting to understand the meaning of number terms in the wrong way, for example, in attempting to understand their meaning independently of the contexts in which they appear in sentences. If we are simply asked to consider what "two" means independently of the context of a sentence, we are likely to simply imagine the numeral "2", or perhaps some conglomeration of two things. Thus, in the Grundlagen, Frege espouses his famous context principle, to "never ask for the meaning of a word in isolation, but only in the context of a proposition." The Grundlagen is an earlier work, written before Frege had made the distinction between sense and reference (see below). It is an active matter of debate and discussion to what extent and how this principle coheres with Frege's later theory of meaning, but what is clear is that it plays an important role in his own philosophy of mathematics as described in the Grundlagen.

According to Frege, if we look at the contexts in which number words usually occur in a proposition, they appear as part of a sentence about a concept, specifically, as part of an expression that tells us how many times a certain concept is instantiated. Consider, for example, "I have six cards in my hand" or "There are 11 members of congress from Wisconsin." These propositions seem to tell us how many times the concepts of being a card in my hand and being a member of congress from Wisconsin are instantiated. Thus, Frege concludes that statements about numbers are statements about concepts. This insight was very important for Frege's case for logicism, as Frege was able to show that it is possible to define what it means for a concept to be instantiated a certain number of times purely logically by making use of quantifiers and identity. To say that the concept F is instantiated zero times is to say that there are no objects that instantiate F, or, equivalently, that everything does not instantiate F. To say that F is instantiated one time is to say there is an object x that instantiates F, and that for all objects y, either y does not instantiate F or y is x. To say that F is instantiated twice is to say that there are two objects, x and y, each of which instantiates F, but which are not the same as each other, and for all z, either z does not instantiate F, or z is x or z is y. One could then consider numbers as "second-level concepts", or concepts of concepts, which can be defined in purely logical terms. (For more on the distinction of levels of concepts, see above.)

Frege, however, does not leave his analysis of numbers there. Understanding number-claims as involving second-level concepts does give us some insight into the nature of numbers, but it cannot be left at this. Mathematics requires that numbers be treated as objects, and that we be able to provide a definition of the number "two" simpliciter, without having to speak of two Fs. For this purpose, Frege appeals to his theory of the value-ranges of concepts. On the notion of a value-range, see above. We saw above that we can gain some understanding of number claims as involving second-level concepts, or concepts of concepts. In order to find a definition of numbers as objects, Frege treats them instead as value-ranges of value-ranges. Exactly, however, are they to be understood?

Frege notes that we have an understanding of what it means to say that there are the same number of Fs as there are Gs. It is to say that there is a one-one mapping between the objects that instantiate F and the objects instantiating G, i.e. that there is some function f from entities that instantiate F onto entities that instantiate G such that there is a different F for every G, and a different G for every F, with none left over. (In this, Frege's views on the nature of cardinality were in part anticipated by Georg Cantor.) However, we must bear in mind that the propositions:

(1) There are equally many Fs as there are Gs.
(2) The number of Fs = the number of Gs

must obviously have the same truth-value, as they seem to express the same fact. We must, therefore, look for a way of understanding the phrase "the number of Fs" that occurs in (2) that makes clear how and why the whole proposition will be true or false for the same reason as (1) is true or false. Frege's suggestion is that "the number of Fs" means the same as "the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F." This means that the number of Fs is a certain value-range, containing value-ranges, and in particular, all those value-ranges that have as many members as there are Fs. Then (2) is understood as saying the same as "the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F = the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as G", which will be true if and only if there are equally many Fs as Gs, i.e. if every value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F is also a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as G.

To give some examples, if there are zero Fs, then the number of Fs, i.e. zero, is the value-range consisting of all value-ranges with no members. Recall that for Frege, classes are identified with value-ranges of concepts. (See above.) To rephrase the same point in terms of classes, zero is the class of all classes with no members. Since there is only one such class, zero is the class containing only the empty class. If there is one F, then the number of Fs, i.e. one, is the class consisting of all classes with one member (the extensions of concepts instantiated once). Here we can see the connection with the understanding of number expressions as being statements about concepts. Rather than understanding zero as the concept a concept has just in case it is not instantiated, zero is understood as the value-range consisting of value-ranges of concepts that are not instantiated. Rather than understanding one as the concept a concept has just in case it is instantiated by a unique object, it is understood as the value-range consisting of value-ranges of concepts instantiated by unique objects. This allows us to understand numbers as abstract objects, and provide a clear definition of the meaning of number signs in arithmetic such as "1", "2", "3", etc.

Some of Frege's most brilliant work came in providing definitions of the natural numbers in his logical language, and in proving some of their properties therein. After laying out the basic laws of logic, and defining axioms governing the truth-functions and value-ranges, etc., Frege begins by defining a relation that holds between two value-ranges just in case they are the value-ranges of concepts instantiated equally many times. This relation holds between value-ranges just in case they are the same size, i.e. just in case there is one-one correspondence between the entities that fall under their concepts. Using this, he then defines a function that takes a value-range as argument and yields as value the value-range consisting of all value-ranges the same size as it. The number zero is then defined as the value-range consisting of all value-ranges the same size as the value-range of the concept being non-self-identical. Since this concept is not instantiated, zero is defined as the value-range of all value-ranges with no members, as described above. There is only one such number zero. Since this is true, then the concept of being identical to zero is instantiated once. Frege then uses this to define one. One is defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept being identical to zero. Having defined one is this way, Frege is able to define two. He has already defined one and zero; they are each unique, but different from each other. Therefore, two can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept being identical to zero or identical to one. Frege is able to define all natural numbers in this way, and indeed, prove that there are infinitely many of them. Each natural number can be defined in terms of the previous one: for each natural number n, its successor (n + 1) can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept of being identical to one of the numbers between zero and n.

In the Begriffsschrift, Frege had already been able to prove certain results regarding series and sequences, and was able to define the ancestral of a relation. To understand the ancestral of a relation, consider the example of the relation of being the child of. A person x bears this relation to y just in case x is y's child. However, x falls in the ancestral of this relation with respect to y just in case x is the child of y, or is the child of y's child, or is the child of y's child's child, etc. Frege was able to define the ancestral of relations logically even in his early work. He put this to use in the Grundgesetze to define the natural numbers. We have seen how the notion of successorship can be defined for Frege, i.e. the relation n + 1 bears to n. The natural numbers can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges that fall under the ancestral of the successor relation with respect to zero. The natural numbers then consist of zero, the successor of zero (one), the successor of the successor of zero (two), and so on ad infinitum. Frege was then able to use this definition of the natural numbers to provide a logical analysis of mathematical induction, and prove that mathematical induction can be used validly to demonstrate the properties of the natural numbers, an extremely important result for making good on his logicist ambitions. Frege could then use mathematical induction to prove some of the basic laws of the natural numbers. Frege next turned his logicist method to an analysis of integers (including negative numbers) and then to the real numbers, defining them using the natural numbers and certain relations holding between them. We need not dwell on the details of this work here.

Frege's approach to providing a logical analysis of cardinality, the natural numbers, infinity and mathematical induction were groundbreaking, and have had a lasting importance within mathematical logic. Indeed, prior to 1902, it must have seemed to him that he had been completely successful in showing that the basic laws of arithmetic could be understood purely as logical truths. However, as we have seen, Frege's definition of numbers heavily involves the notion of classes or value-ranges, but his logical treatment of them is shown to be impossible due to Russell's paradox. This presents a serious problem for Frege's logicist approach. Another heavy blow came after Frege's death. In 1931, Kurt Gödel discovered his famous incompleteness proof to the effect that there can be no consistent formal system with a finite number of axioms in which it is possible to derive all of the truths of arithmetic. This presents a serious blow to more ambitious forms of logicism, such as Frege's, which aimed to provide precisely the sort of system Gödel showed impossible. Nevertheless, it cannot be denied that Frege's work in the philosophy of mathematics was important and insightful.

4. The Theory of Sense and Reference

Frege's influential theory of meaning, the theory of sense (Sinn) and reference (Bedeutung) was first outlined, albeit briefly, in his article, "Funktion und Begriff" of 1891, and was expanded and explained in greater detail in perhaps his most famous work, "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" of 1892. In "Funktion und Begriff", the distinction between the sense and reference of signs in language is first made in regard to mathematical equations. During Frege's time, there was a widespread dispute among mathematicians as to how the sign, "=", should be understood. If we consider an equation such as, "4 x 2 = 11 - 3", a number of Frege's contemporaries, for a variety of reasons, were wary of viewing this as an expression of an identity, or, in this case, as the claim that 4 x 2 and 11 - 3 are one and the same thing. Instead, they posited some weaker form of "equality" such that the numbers 4 x 2 and 11 - 3 would be said to be equal in number or equal in magnitude without thereby constituting one and the same thing. In opposition to the view that "=" signifies identity, such thinkers would point out that 4 x 2 and 11 - 3 cannot in all ways be thought to be the same. The former is a product, the latter a difference, etc.

In his mature period, however, Frege was an ardent opponent of this view, and argued in favor of understanding "=" as identity proper, accusing rival views of confusing form and content. He argues instead that expressions such as "4 x 2" and "11 - 3" can be understood as standing for one and the same thing, the number eight, but that this single entity is determined or presented differently by the two expressions. Thus, he makes a distinction between the actual number a mathematical expression such as "4 x 2" stands for, and the way in which that number is determined or picked out. The former he called the reference (Bedeutung) of the expression, and the latter was called the sense (Sinn) of the expression. In Fregean terminology, an expression is said to express its sense, and denote or refer to its reference.

The distinction between reference and sense was expanded, primarily in "Über Sinn und Bedeutung" as holding not only for mathematical expressions, but for all linguistic expressions (whether the language in question is natural language or a formal language). One of his primary examples therein involves the expressions "the morning star" and "the evening star". Both of these expressions refer to the planet Venus, yet they obviously denote Venus in virtue of different properties that it has. Thus, Frege claims that these two expressions have the same reference but different senses. The reference of an expression is the actual thing corresponding to it, in the case of "the morning star", the reference is the planet Venus itself. The sense of an expression, however, is the "mode of presentation" or cognitive content associated with the expression in virtue of which the reference is picked out.

Frege puts the distinction to work in solving a puzzle concerning identity claims. If we consider the two claims:

(1) the morning star = the morning star

(2) the morning star = the evening star

The first appears to be a trivial case of the law of self-identity, knowable a priori, while the second seems to be something that was discovered a posteriori by astronomers. However, if "the morning star" means the same thing as "the evening star", then the two statements themselves would also seem to have the same meaning, both involving a thing's relation of identity to itself. However, it then becomes to difficult to explain why (2) seems informative while (1) does not. Frege's response to this puzzle, given the distinction between sense and reference, should be apparent. Because the reference of "the evening star" and "the morning star" is the same, both statements are true in virtue of the same object's relation of identity to itself. However, because the senses of these expressions are different--in (1) the object is presented the same way twice, and in (2) it is presented in two different ways--it is informative to learn of (2). While the truth of an identity statement involves only the references of the component expressions, the informativity of such statements involves additionally the way in which those references are determined, i.e. the senses of the component expressions.

So far we have only considered the distinction as it applies to expressions that name some object (including abstract objects, such as numbers). For Frege, the distinction applies also to other sorts of expressions and even whole sentences or propositions. If the sense/reference distinction can be applied to whole propositions, it stands to reason that the reference of the whole proposition depends on the references of the parts and the sense of the proposition depends of the senses of the parts. (At some points, Frege even suggests that the sense of a whole proposition is composed of the senses of the component expressions.) In the example considered in the previous paragraph, it was seen that the truth-value of the identity claim depends on the references of the component expressions, while the informativity of what was understood by the identity claim depends on the senses. For this and other reasons, Frege concluded that the reference of an entire proposition is its truth-value, either the True or the False. The sense of a complete proposition is what it is we understand when we understand a proposition, which Frege calls "a thought" (Gedanke). Just as the sense of a name of an object determines how that object is presented, the sense of a proposition determines a method of determination for a truth-value. The propositions, "2 + 4 = 6" and "the Earth rotates", both have the True as their references, though this is in virtue of very different conditions holding in the two cases, just as "the morning star" and "the evening star" refer to Venus in virtue of different properties.

In "Über Sinn und Bedeutung", Frege limits his discussion of the sense/reference distinction to "complete expressions" such as names purporting to pick out some object and whole propositions. However, in other works, Frege makes it quite clear that the distinction can also be applied to "incomplete expressions", which include functional expressions and grammatical predicates. These expressions are incomplete in the sense that they contain an "empty space", which, when filled, yields either a complex name referring to an object, or a complete proposition. Thus, the incomplete expression "the square root of ( )" contains a blank spot, which, when completed by an expression referring to a number, yields a complex expression also referring to a number, e.g., "the square root of sixteen". The incomplete expression, "( ) is a planet" contains an empty place, which, when filled with a name, yields a complete proposition. According to Frege, the references of these incomplete expressions are not objects but functions. Objects (Gegenstände), in Frege's terminology, are self-standing, complete entities, while functions are essentially incomplete, or as Frege says, "unsaturated" (ungesättigt) in that they must take something else as argument in order to yield a value. The reference of the expression "square root of ( )" is thus a function, which takes numbers as arguments and yields numbers as values. The situation may appear somewhat different in the case of grammatical predicates. However, because Frege holds that complete propositions, like names, have objects as their references, and in particular, the truth-values the True or the False, he is able to treat predicates also as having functions as their references. In particular, they are functions mapping objects onto truth-values. The expression, "( ) is a planet" has as its reference a function that yields as value the True when saturated by an object such as Saturn or Venus, but the False when saturated by a person or the number three. Frege calls such a function of one argument place that yields the True or False for every possible argument a "concept" (Begriff), and calls similar functions of more than one argument place (such as that denoted by "( ) > ( )", which is doubly in need of saturation), "relations".

It is clear that functions are to be understood as the references of incomplete expressions, but what of the senses of such expressions? Here, Frege tells us relatively little save that they exist. There is some amount of controversy among interpreters of Frege as to how they should be understood. It suffices here to note that just as the same object (e.g. the planet Venus), can be presented in different ways, so also can a function be presented in different ways. While "identity", as Frege uses the term, is a relation holding only between objects, Frege believes that there is a relation similar to identity that holds between functions just in case they always share the same value for every argument. Since all and only those things that have hearts have kidneys, strictly speaking, the concepts denoted by the expressions "( ) has a heart", and "( ) has a kidney" are one and the same. Clearly, however, these expressions do not present that concept in the same way. For Frege, these expressions would have different senses but the same reference. Frege also tells us that it is the incomplete nature of these senses that provides the "glue" holding together the thoughts of which they form a part.

Frege also uses the distinction to solve what appears to be a difficulty with Leibniz's law with regard to identity. This law was stated by Leibniz as, "those things are the same of which one can be substituted for another without loss of truth," a sentiment with which Frege was in full agreement. As Frege understands this, it means that if two expressions have the same reference, they should be able to replace each other within any proposition without changing the truth-value of that proposition. Normally, this poses no problem. The inference from:

(3) The morning star is a planet.

to the conclusion:

(4) The evening star is a planet.

in virtue of (2) above and Leibniz's law is unproblematically valid. However, there seem to be some serious counterexamples to this principle. We know for example that "the morning star" and "the evening star" have the same customary reference. However, it is not always true that they can replace one another without changing the truth of a sentence. For example, if we consider the propositions:

(5) Gottlob believes that the morning star is a planet.

(6) Gottlob believes that the evening star is a planet.

If we assume that Gottlob does not know that the morning star is the same heavenly body as the evening star, (5) may be true while (6) false or vice versa.

Frege meets this challenge to Leibniz's law by making a distinction between what he calls the primary and secondary references of expressions. Frege suggests that when expressions appear in certain unusual contexts, they have as their references what is customarily their senses. In such cases, the expressions are said to have their secondary references. Typically, such cases involve what Frege calls "indirect speech" or "oratio obliqua", as in the case of statements of beliefs, thoughts, desires and other so-called "propositional attitudes", such as the examples of (5) and (6). However, expressions also have their secondary references (for reasons which should already be apparent) in contexts such as "it is informative that..." or "... is analytically true".

Let us consider the examples of (5) and (6) more closely. To Frege's mind, these statements do not deal directly with the morning star and the evening star itself. Rather, they involve a relation between a believer and a thought believed. Thoughts, as we have seen, are the senses of complete propositions. Beliefs depend for their make-up on how certain objects and concepts are presented, not only on the objects and concepts themselves. The truth of belief claims, therefore, will depend not on the customary references of the component expressions of the stated belief, but their senses. Since the truth-value of the whole belief claim is the reference of that belief claim, and the reference of any proposition, for Frege, depends on the references of its component expressions, we are lead to the conclusion that the typical senses of expressions that appear in oratio obliqua are in fact the references of those expressions when they appear in that context. Such contexts can be referred to as "oblique contexts", contexts in which the reference of an expression is shifted from its customary reference to its customary sense.

In this way, Frege is able to actually retain his commitment in Leibniz's law. The expressions "the morning star" and "the evening star" have the same primary reference, and in any non-oblique context, they can replace each other without changing the truth-value of the proposition. However, since the senses of these expressions are not the same, they cannot replace each other in oblique contexts, because in such contexts, their references are non-identical.

Frege ascribes to senses and thoughts objective existence. In his mind, they are objects every bit as real as tables and chairs. Their existence is not dependent on language or the mind. Instead, they are said to exist in a timeless "third realm" of sense, existing apart from both the mental and the physical. Frege concludes this because, although senses are obviously not physical entities, their existence likewise does not depend on any one person's psychology. A thought, for example, has a truth-value regardless of whether or not anyone believes it and even whether or not anyone has grasped it at all. Moreover, senses are interpersonal. Different people are able to grasp the same senses and same thoughts and communicate them, and it is even possible for expressions in different languages to express the same sense or thought. Frege concludes that they are abstract objects, incapable of full causal interaction with the physical world. They are actual only in the very limited sense that they can have an effect on those who grasp them, but are themselves incapable of being changed or acted upon. They are neither created by our uses of language or acts of thinking, nor destroyed by their cessation.

Unfortunately, Frege does not tell us very much about exactly how these abstract objects pick out or present their references. Exactly what is it that makes a sense a "way of determining" or "mode of presenting" a reference? In the wake of Russell's theory of descriptions, a Fregean sense is often interpreted as a set of descriptive information or criteria that picks out its reference in virtue of the reference alone satisfying or fitting that descriptive information. In giving examples, Frege implies that a person might attach to the name "Aristotle" the sense the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great. This sense picks out Aristotle the person because he alone matches this description. Here, care must be taken to avoid misunderstanding. The sense of the name "Aristotle" is not the words "the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great"; to repeat, senses are not linguistic items. It is rather that the sense consists in some set of descriptive information, and this information is best described by a descriptive phrase of this form. The property of being the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander is unique to Aristotle, and thus, it may be in virtue of associating this information with the name "Aristotle" that this name may be used to refer to Aristotle. As certain commentators have noted, it is not even necessary that the sense of the name be expressible by some descriptive phrase, because the descriptive information or properties in virtue of which the reference is determined may not be directly nameable in any natural language.

From this standpoint, it is easy to understand how there might be senses that do not pick out any reference. Names such as "Romulus" or "Odysseus", and phrases such as "the least rapidly converging series" or "the present King of France" express senses, insofar as they lay out criteria that things would have to satisfy if they were to be the references of these expressions. However, there are no things which do in fact satisfy these criteria. Therefore, these expressions are meaningful, but do not have references. Because the sense of a whole proposition is determined by the senses of the parts, and the reference of a whole proposition is determined by the parts, Frege claims that propositions in which such expressions appear are able to express thoughts, but are neither true nor false, because no references are determined for them.

This interpretation of the nature of senses makes Frege a forerunner to what has since been come to be known as the "descriptivist" theory of meaning and reference in the philosophy of language. The view that the sense of a proper name such as "Aristotle" could be descriptive information as simple as the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great, however, has been harshly criticized by many philosophers, and perhaps most notably by Saul Kripke. Kripke points out that this would make a claim such as "Aristotle taught Alexander" seem to be a necessary and analytic truth, which it does not appear to be. Moreover, he claims that many of us seem to be able to use a name to refer to an individual even if we are unaware of any properties uniquely held by that individual. For example, many of us don't know enough about the physicist Richard Feynman to be able to identify a property differentiating him from other prominent physicists such as Murray Gell-Mann, but we still seem to be able to refer to Feynman with the name "Feynman". John Searle, Michael Dummett and others, however, have proposed ways of expanding or altering Frege's notion of a sense to circumvent Kripke's worries. This has lead to a very important debate in the philosophy of language, which, unfortunately, we cannot fully discuss here.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Frege's Own Works

  • "Antwort auf die Ferienplauderei des Herrn Thomae." Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 15 (1906): 586-90. Translated as "Reply to Thomae's Holiday Causerie." In Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic and Philosophy [CP], 341-5. Translated by M. Black, V. Dudman, P. Geach, H. Kaal, E.-H. W. Kluge, B. McGuinness and R. H. Stoothoff. New York: Basil Blackwell, 1984.
  • "Über Begriff und Gegenstand." Vierteljahrsschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie 16 (1892): 192-205. Translated as "On Concept and Object." In >CP 182-94. Also in The Frege Reader [FR], 181-93. Edited by Michael Beaney. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997. And In Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege [TPW], 42-55. 3d ed. Edited by Peter Geach and Max Black. Oxford: Blackwell, 1980.
  • Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens. Halle: L. Nebert, 1879. Translated as Begriffsschrift, a Formula Language, Modeled upon that of Arithmetic, for Pure Thought. In From Frege to Gödel, edited by Jean van Heijenoort. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1967. Also as Conceptual Notation and Related Articles. Edited and translated by Terrell W. Bynum. London: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • "Über die Begriffsschrift des Herrn Peano und meine eigene." Verhandlungen der Königlich Sächsischen Gesellschaft der Wissenschaften zu Leipzig 48 (1897): 362-8. Translated as "On Mr. Peano's Conceptual Notation and My Own." In CP 234-48.
  • "Über formale Theorien der Arithmetik." Sitzungsberichte der Jenaischen Gesellschaft für Medizin und Naturwissenschaft 19 (1885): 94-104. Translated as "On Formal Theories of Arithmetic." In CP 112-21.
  • Funktion und Begriff. Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1891. Translated as "Function and Concept." In CP 137-56, TPW 21-41 and FR 130-48.
  • "Der Gedanke." Beträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-9): 58-77. Translated as "Thoughts." In CP 351-72. Also as part I of Logical Investigations [LI], edited by P. T. Geach. Oxford: Blackwell, 1977. And as "Thought." In FR 325-45.
  • "Gedankengefüge." Beträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 3 (1923): 36-51. Translated as "Compound Thoughts." In CP 390-406, and as part III of LI.
  • Über eine geometrische Darstellung der imaginären Gebilde in der Ebene. Ph. D. Dissertation: University of Göttingen, 1873. Translated as "On a Geometrical Representation of Imaginary Forms in the Plane." In CP 1-55.
  • Grundgesetze der Arithmetik. 2 vols. Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1893-1903. Translated in part as The Basic Laws of Arithmetic: Exposition of the System. Edited and translated by Montgomery Furth. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964.
  • "Über die Grundlagen der Geometrie." Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 12 (1903): 319-24, 368-75, 15 (1906): 293-309, 377-403, 423-30. Translated as "On the Foundations of Geometry." In CP 273-340. Also as On the Foundations of Geometry and Formal Theories of Arithmetic. Translated by Eike-Henner W. Kluge. New York: Yale University Press, 1971.
  • Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, eine logisch mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl. Breslau: W. Koebner, 1884. Translated as The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number. 2d ed. Translated by J. L. Austin. Oxford: Blackwell, 1953.
  • "Kritische Beleuchtung einiger Punkte in E. Schröders Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik." Archiv für systematsche Philosophie 1 (1895): 433-56. Translated as "A Critical Elucidation of Some Points in E. Schröder, Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik." In CP 210-28, and TPW 86-106.
  • Nachgelassene Schriften. Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1969. Translated as Posthumous Writings. Translated by Peter Long and Roger White. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1979.
  • "Le nombre entier." Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 3 (1895): 73-8. Translated as "Whole Numbers." In CP 229-33.
  • Rechnungsmethoden, die auf eine Erweiterung des Grössenbegriffes gründen. Habilitationsschrift: University of Jena, 1874. Translated as "Methods of Calculation based on an Extension of the Concept of Quantity." In CP 56-92.
  • Review of Zur Lehre vom Transfiniten, by Georg Cantor. Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 100 (1892): 269-72. Translated in CP 178-181.
  • Review of Philosophie der Arithmetik, by Edmund Husserl. Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 103 (1894): 313-32. Translated in CP 195-209.
  • "Über Sinn und Bedeutung." Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 100 (1892): 25-50. Translated as "On Sense and Meaning." In CP 157-77. As "On Sinn and Bedeutung." In FR 151-71. And as "On Sense and Reference." In TPW 56-78.
  • "Über das Trägheitsgesetz." Zeitschrift für Philosophie und philosophische Kritik 98 (1891): 145-61. Translated as "On the Law of Inertia." In CP 123-36.
  • "Die Unmöglichkeit der Thomaeschen formalen Arithmetik aus Neue nachgewiesen." Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 17 (1908): 52-5. Translated as "Renewed Proof of the Impossibility of Mr. Thomae's Formal Arithmetic." In CP 346-50.
  • "Der Verneinung." Beträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus 1 (1918-9): 143-57. Translated as "Negation." In CP 373-89, part II of LI, and FR 346-61.
  • "Was ist ein Funktion?" In Festschrift Ludwig Boltzmann gewidmet zum sechzigsten Geburtstage, 656-66. Leipzig: Amrosius Barth, 1904. Translated as "What is a Function?" In CP 285-92, and TPW 285-92.
  • Wissenschaftlicher Briefwechsel. Hamburg: Felix Meiner, 1976. Translated as Philosophical and Mathematical Correspondence. Translated by Hans Kaal. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980.
  • Über die Zahlen des Herrn H. Schubert. Jena: Hermann Pohle, 1899. Translated as "On Mr. H. Schubert's Numbers." In CP 249-72.

b. Important Secondary Works

  • Angelelli, Ignacio. Studies on Gottlob Frege and Traditional Philosophy. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1967.
  • Baker, G. P. and P. M. S. Hacker. Frege: Logical Excavations. New York: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Beaney, Michael. Frege: Making Sense. London: Duckworth, 1996.
  • Beaney, Michael. Introduction to The Frege Reader, by Gottlob Frege. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997.
  • Bell, David. Frege's Theory of Judgment. New York: Oxford University Press, 1979.
  • Bynum, Terrell W. "On the Life and Work of Gottlob Frege. " Introduction to Conceptual Notation and Related Articles, by Gottlob Frege. London: Oxford University Press, 1972.
  • Carl, Wolfgang. Frege's Theory of Sense and Reference. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1994.
  • Carnap, Rudolph. Meaning and Necessity. 2d ed. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1956.
  • Church, Alonzo. "A Formulation of the Logic of Sense and Denotation." In Structure, Method and Meaning: Essays in Honor of Henry M. Sheffer, edited by P. Henle, H. Kallen and S. Langer, 3- 24. New York: Liberal Arts Press, 1951.
  • Currie, Gregory. Frege: An Introduction to His Philosophy. Totowa, NJ: Barnes and Noble, 1982.
  • Dummett, Michael. Frege: Philosophy of Language. 2d ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981.
  • Dummett, Michael. Frege: Philosophy of Mathematics. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1991.
  • Dummett, Michael. Frege and Other Philosophers. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1991.
  • Dummett, Michael. The Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1981.
  • Geach, Peter T. "Frege." In Three Philosophers, edited by G. E. M. Anscombe and P. T. Geach, 127-62. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1961.
  • Gödel, Kurt. "On Formally Undecidable Propositions of Principia Mathematica and Related Systems I." In From Frege to Gödel, edited by Jan van Heijenoort, 596-616. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1967. Originally published as "Über formal unentscheidbare Sätze der Principia Mathematica und verwandter Systeme I." Monatshefte für Mathematik und Physik 38 (1931): 173-98.
  • Grossmann, Reinhardt. Reflections on Frege's Philosophy. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1969.
  • Haaparanta, Leila and Jaakko Hintikka, eds. Frege Synthesized. Boston: D. Reidel, 1986.
  • Kaplan, David. "Quantifying In." Synthese 19 (1968): 178-214.
  • Klemke, E. D., ed. Essays on Frege. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1968.
  • Kluge, Eike-Henner W. The Metaphysics of Gottlob Frege. Boston: Martinus Nijhoff, Boston, 1980.
  • Kneale, William and Martha Kneale. The Development of Logic. London: Oxford University Press, 1962.
  • Kripke, Saul. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1980. First published in Semantics of Natural Languages. Edited by Donald Davidson and Gilbert Harman. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1972.
  • Linsky, Leonard. Oblique Contexts. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1983.
  • Resnik, Michael D. Frege and the Philosophy of Mathematics. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1980.
  • Ricketts, Thomas G., ed. The Cambridge Companion to Frege. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, forthcoming.
  • Russell, Bertrand. "The Logical and Arithmetical Doctrines of Frege." In The Principles of Mathematics, Appendix A. 1903. 2d. ed. Reprint, New York: W. W. Norton & Company, 1996.
  • Russell, Bertrand. "On Denoting." Mind 14 (1905): 479-93.
  • Salmon, Nathan. Frege's Puzzle. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1986.
  • Schirn. Matthias, ed. Logik und Mathematik: Frege Kolloquium 1993. Hawthorne: de Gruyter, 1995.
  • Schirn. Matthias, ed. Studien zu Frege. 3 vols. Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Verlag-Holzboog, 1976.
  • Searle, John R. Intentionality: An Essay in the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983.
  • Sluga, Hans. "Frege and the Rise of Analytic Philosophy." Inquiry 18 (1975): 471-87.
  • Sluga, Hans. Gottlob Frege. Boston: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.
  • Sluga, Hans. The Philosophy of Frege. 4 vols. New York: Garland Publishing, 1993.
  • Sternfeld, Robert. Frege's Logical Theory. Carbondale: Southern Illinois University Press, 1966.
  • Thiel, Christian. Sense and Reference in Frege's Logic. Translated by T. J. Blakeley. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1968.
  • Tichý, Pavel. The Foundations of Frege's Logic. New York: Walter de Gruyter, 1988.
  • Walker, Jeremy D. B. A Study of Frege. London: Oxford University Press, 1965.
  • Weiner, Joan. Frege in Perspective. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990.
  • Wright, Crispin. Frege's Conception of Numbers as Objects. Aberdeen: Aberdeen University Press, 1983.
  • Wright, Crispin. Frege: Tradition and Influence. Oxford: Blackwell, 1984.

Author Information

Kevin C. Klement
Email: klement@philos.umass.edu
University of Massachusetts, Amherst
U. S. A.

Benedict De Spinoza (1632—1677)

spinozaBenedict de Spinoza  was among the most important of the post-Cartesian philosophers who flourished in the second half of the 17th century. He made significant contributions in virtually every area of philosophy, and his writings reveal the influence of such divergent sources as Stoicism, Jewish Rationalism, Machiavelli, Hobbes, Descartes, and a variety of heterodox religious thinkers of his day. For this reason he is difficult to categorize, though he is usually counted, along with Descartes and Leibniz, as one of the three major Rationalists. Given Spinoza’s devaluation of sense perception as a means of acquiring knowledge, his description of a purely intellectual form of cognition, and his idealization of geometry as a model for philosophy, this categorization is fair. But it should not blind us to the eclecticism of his pursuits, nor to the striking originality of his thought.

Among philosophers, Spinoza is best known for his Ethics, a monumental work that presents an ethical vision unfolding out of a monistic metaphysics in which God and Nature are identified. God is no longer the transcendent creator of the universe who rules it via providence, but Nature itself, understood as an infinite, necessary, and fully deterministic system of which humans are a part. Humans find happiness only through a rational understanding of this system and their place within it. On account of this and the many other provocative positions he advocates, Spinoza has remained an enormously controversial figure. For many, he is the harbinger of enlightened modernity who calls us to live by the guidance of reason. For others, he is the enemy of the traditions that sustain us and the denier of what is noble within us. After a review of Spinoza’s life and works, this article examines the main themes of his philosophy, primarily as they are set forth in the Ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Geometric Method and the Ethics
  3. Metaphysics
    1. Substance Monism
      1. Definitions
      2. Preliminary Propositions
      3. Substance Monism Demonstrated
    2. The Modal System
      1. Natura naturans and Natura naturata
      2. Two Types of Mode
      3. Causal Determinism
      4. Causal Parallelism
  4. Mind and Cognition
    1. The Mind as the Idea of the Body
    2. Imagination
      1. Sense Perception
    3. Inadequate Ideas
    4. Adequate Ideas
    5. Three Kinds of Knowledge
  5. Psychology
    1. Rejection of Free-Will
    2. The Conatus Principle
    3. The Affects
    4. Bondage
  6. Ethics
    1. Freedom from the Passions
    2. Conatus and the Guidance of Reason
    3. Knowledge of God as the Highest Good
    4. Intellectual Love of God and Human Blessedness
    5. Eternity of the Mind
    6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts and Translations of Spinoza
    2. General Studies Suitable as Introductions
    3. More Advanced and Specialized Studies
    4. Collected Essays on Spinoza

1. Life and Works

Spinoza came into the world a Jew. Born in 1632, he was the son of Marrano parents. They had immigrated to Amsterdam from Portugal in order to escape the Inquisition that had spread across the Iberian Peninsula and live in the relatively tolerant atmosphere of Holland. Spinoza's father, Michael, was a successful merchant and a respected member of the community. His mother, Hanna, the second of Michael's three wives, died in 1638, just before Spinoza was to turn six.

The young Spinoza, given the name Baruch, was educated in his congregation's academy, the Talmud Torah school. There he received the kind of education that the community deemed necessary to constitute one as an educated Jew. This largely consisted of religious study , including instruction in Hebrew, liturgy, Torah, prophetic writings, and rabbinical commentaries. Although Spinoza no doubt excelled in these, he did not move on to the higher levels of study which focused on the Talmud and were typically undertaken by those preparing for the rabbinate. Whether by desire or by necessity, Spinoza left the school in order to work in his father's business, which he eventually took over with his half-brother, Gabriel.

The Jewish community in Amsterdam was by no means a closed one , but Spinoza's commercial activities put him in touch with more diverse currents of thought than those to which he had hitherto been exposed. Most significantly, he came into contact with so-called 'free-thinking' Protestants - dissenters from the dominant Calvinism – who maintained a lively interest in a wide range of theological issues, as well as in the latest developments in philosophy and science. This naturally included the work of Descartes, which was regarded by many in Holland to be the most promising of several alternatives to scholasticism that had emerged in recent decades. In order to discuss their interests, these free-thinkers organized themselves into small groups, they called colleges, which met on a regular basis. Spinoza may have attended such meetings as early as the first half of the 1650's, and it is most likely here that he received his first exposure to Cartesian thought.

This is not to say that Spinoza ceased to mine the resources of his own tradition - he became steeped, for example, in the writings of such philosophically important figures as Maimonides and Gersonides - but his intellectual horizons were expanding and he was experiencing a restlessness that drove him to look further afield. It was at this time that he placed himself under the tutelage of an ex-Jesuit, Franciscus Van den Enden, who had recently set up a Latin school in Amsterdam. Van den Enden turned out to be the perfect teacher for Spinoza. In addition to having an excellent reputation as a Latinist, he was a medical doctor who kept abreast of all that was new in the sciences. He was also notorious for his allegedly irreligious cast of mind, and he was a passionate advocate of democratic political ideals. It is safe to say that Spinoza's studies with Van den Enden included more than lessons on how to decline nouns.

Spinoza's intellectual reorientation, however, came at a cost . His increasingly unorthodox views and, perhaps, laxity in his observance of the Jewish law strained his relations with the community. Tensions became so great that, in 1656, the elders of the synagogue undertook proceedings to excommunicate him. Without providing details, the writ of excommunication accuses him of 'abominable heresies' and ‘monstrous deeds’. It then levels a series of curses against him and prohibits others from communicating with him, doing business with him, reading anything he might write, or even coming into close proximity with him. Spinoza may still have been a Jew, but he was now an outcast.

Little is known about Spinoza's activities in the years immediately following his excommunication. He continued his studies with Van den Enden and occasionally took up residence in his teacher's home. As it was now impossible for him to carry on in commerce, it was most likely at this time that he took up lens grinding as an occupation. There is also evidence that he traveled periodically to Leiden to study at the university. There he would have received formal instruction in Cartesian philosophy and become familiar with the work of prominent Dutch Cartesians. In 1661, he settled near Leiden, in the town of Rijnsburg.

It was during this same period, in the late 1650's, that Spinoza embarked upon his literary career. His first work, the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, is an attempt to formulate a philosophical method that would allow the mind to form the clear and distinct ideas that are necessary for its perfection. It contains, in addition, reflection upon the various kinds of knowledge, an extended treatment of definition, and a lengthy analysis of the nature and causes of doubt. For reasons that are unknown, theTreatise was left unfinished, though it appears that Spinoza always intended to complete it. Shortly thereafter, while in Rijnsburg, Spinoza set to work on his Short Treatise on God, Man, and His Well-Being. This work, circulated privately among friends, foreshadows many of the themes of his mature work, the Ethics. Most notably, it contains an unambiguous statement of the most famous of Spinoza's theses - the identity of God and Nature.

Spinoza's stay in Rijnsburg was brief. In 1663 he moved to the town of Voorburg, not far from The Hague, where he settled into a quiet, but busy, life. At the behest of friends, he immediately set about preparing for publication a set of lessons that he had given to a student in Leiden on Descartes'sPrinciples of Philosophy. The result was the only work that he was to publish under his own name, now Latinized to Benedict: René Descartes's Principles of Philosophy, Parts I and II, Demonstrated According to the Geometric Method by Benedict de Spinoza of Amsterdam. As a condition of publication, Spinoza had his friend, Lodewijk Meyer, write a preface to the work, warning the reader that his aim was exposition only and that he did not endorse all of Descartes's conclusions. He also appended a short piece, entitled Metaphysical Thoughts, in which he sketched some of his own views. Despite his admiration for Descartes, Spinoza did not want to be seen as a Cartesian.

Spinoza's work on Descartes shows him to have been interested from early on in the use of geometric method in philosophy. In addition to putting parts of the Principles into geometric form, he began experimenting with geometric demonstrations of material taken from his own Short Treatise. It was out of this experimentation that the idea arose for a fully geometric presentation of his thought. He began work on this sometime in the early 1660's, and by 1665 substantial portions of what was to become theEthics were circulating in draft form among his friends back in Amsterdam. Though he was well into the project by then, the political and religious climate of the day made Spinoza hesitant to complete it . He chose to exercise caution and suspended work on it, turning instead to a book that would prepare an audience receptive to the Ethics. This was the Theological-Political Treatise, which he completed and published anonymously in 1670.

Spinoza's aim in the Theological-Political Treatise was to argue that the stability and security of society is not undermined but, rather, enhanced by freedom of thought, meaning primarily the freedom to philosophize. As is clear from the text, he considered the primary threat to this freedom emanated from the clergy, whom he accused of playing upon the fears and superstitions of people in order to maintain power. His solution was to divest the clergy of all political power, even to the point of placing authority over the practice of religion in the hands of the sovereign. The sovereign, Spinoza argued, should extend broad liberties within this domain, requiring adherence to no more than a minimal creed that was neutral with respect to competing sects and the meaning of which was open to a variety of interpretations. This, he hoped, would allow philosophers the freedom to do their work unencumbered by the constraints of sectarianism.

As was to be expected, the Theological-Political Treatise was met with a firestorm of criticism. It was condemned as a work of evil, and its author was accused of having nefarious intentions in writing it. Even some of Spinoza's closest friends were deeply unsettled by it. Though he had assiduously tried to avoid it, Spinoza found himself embroiled in heated religious controversy and saddled with a reputation for atheism, something he greatly resented.

Spinoza's last move, in 1670, was to The Hague, where he was to live out his remaining years. Besides having to deal with fallout from his Theological-Political Treatise, he witnessed a political revolution that culminated in the murder of the Grand Pensionary of Holland, Jan De Witt, along with his brother, Cornelius, by an angry mob of Orangist-Calvinists. Spinoza admired De Witt for his liberal policies and was horrified at the murder. With the ascent of the Orangist-Calvinist faction, he felt his own situation to be tenuous.

Despite these distractions, Spinoza pressed on. He undertook new projects, including the writing of a Hebrew grammar, and he turned back to work on the Ethics. Given the hostility with which theTheological-Political Treatise was met and the realities of the new political landscape, he must have done so with a deep sense of pessimism about its chances for success. By 1675 it was complete. As he perceived his enemies to have grown in influence and opportunity, however, Spinoza decided against publishing it. Public viewing of the definitive statement of his philosophy would have to wait until after his death.

By this time Spinoza was in a state of failing health. Weakened by a respiratory illness, he devoted the last year of his life to writing a work of political philosophy, his Political Treatise. Though left unfinished at his death, Spinoza's intention was to show how governments of all types could be improved and to argue for the superiority of democracy over other forms of political organization. Following the lead of Machiavelli and Hobbes, his argument was to be non-utopian, based on a realistic assessment of human nature drawn from the psychological theory set forth in the Ethics. In the part he did finish, Spinoza showed himself to be an astute analyst of diverse constitutional forms and an original thinker among liberal social contract theorists.

Spinoza died peacefully in his rented room in The Hague in 1677. He left no will, but the manuscripts of his unpublished works - the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, the Ethics, the Hebrew Grammar, and the Political Treatise - along with his correspondence were found in in his desk. These were immediately shipped to Amsterdam for publication, and in short order they appeared in print as B.D.S. Opus Posthuma. But even in death Spinoza could not escape controversy; in 1678, these works were banned throughout Holland.

2. Geometric Method and the Ethics

Upon opening Spinoza's masterpiece, the Ethics, one is immediately struck by its form. It is written in the style of a geometrical treatise, much like Euclid's Elements, with each book comprising a set of definitions, axioms, propositions, scholia, and other features that make up the formal apparatus of geometry. One wonders why Spinoza would have employed this mode of presentation. The effort it required must have been enormous, and the result is a work that only the most dedicated of readers can make their way through.

Some of this is explained by the fact that the seventeenth century was a time in which geometry was enjoying a resurgence of interest and was held in extraordinarily high esteem, especially within the intellectual circles in which Spinoza moved. We may add to this the fact that Spinoza, though not a Cartesian, was an avid student of Descartes's works. As is well known, Descartes was the leading advocate of the use of geometric method within philosophy, and his Meditations was written more geometrico, in the geometrical style. In this respect the Ethics can be said to be Cartesian in inspiration.

While this characterization is true, it needs qualification. The Meditations and the Ethics are very different works, not just in substance, but also in style. In order to understand this difference one must take into account the distinction between two types of geometrical method, the analytic and the synthetic. Descartes explains this distinction as follows:

Analysis shows the true way by means of which the thing in question was discovered methodically and as it were a priori, so that if the reader is willing to follow it and give sufficient attention to all points, he will make the thing his own and understand it just as perfectly as if he had discovered it for himself. . . . . Synthesis, by contrast, employs a directly opposite method where the search is, as it were, a posteriori . . . . It demonstrates the conclusion clearly and employs a long series of definitions, postulates, axioms, theorems and problems, so that if anyone denies one of the conclusions it can be shown at once that it is contained in what has gone before, and hence the reader, however argumentative or stubborn he may be, is compelled to give his assent. (CSM II,110-111)

The analytic method is the way of discovery. Its aim is to lead the mind to the apprehension of primary truths that can serve as the foundation of a discipline. The synthetic method is the way of invention. Its aim is to build up from a set of primary truths a system of results, each of which is fully established on the basis of what has come before. As the Meditations is a work whose explicit aim is to establish the foundations of scientific knowledge, it is appropriate that it employs the analytic method. The Ethics, however, has another aim, one for which the synthetic method is appropriate.

As its title indicates, the Ethics is a work of ethical philosophy. Its ultimate aim is to aid us in the attainment of happiness, which is to be found in the intellectual love of God. This love, according to Spinoza, arises out of the knowledge that we gain of the divine essence insofar as we see how the essences of singular things follow of necessity from it. In view of this, it is easy to see why Spinoza favored the synthetic method. Beginning with propositions concerning God, he was able to employ it to show how all other things can be derived from God. In grasping the order of propositions as they are demonstrated in the Ethics, we thus attain a kind of knowledge that approximates the knowledge that underwrites human happiness. We are, as it were, put on the road towards happiness. Of the two methods it is only the synthetic method that is suitable for this purpose.

3. Metaphysics

Although the Ethics is not principally a work of metaphysics, the system it lays out stands as one of the great monuments in the tradition of grand metaphysical speculation. What is perhaps most noteworthy about this system is that it is a species of monism - the doctrine that all of reality is in some significant sense one. In Spinoza's case, this is exemplified by the claim that there is one and only one substance. This substance he identifies as God. While monism has had its defenders in the west, they have been few and far between. Spinoza is arguably the greatest among them.

a. Substance Monism

Spinoza builds his case for substance monism in a tightly reasoned argument that culminates in IP14. We may best follow the course of this argument by taking it in three parts. First, we examine four definitions that play a crucial role in the argument. Second, we look at two propositions to which the demonstration of IP14 appeals. And third, we turn to the demonstration of IP14 itself.

i. Definitions

Among the eight definitions that open Book One of the Ethics, the following four are most important to the argument for substance monism:

ID3: By substance I understand what is in itself and is conceived through itself, that is, that whose concept does not require the concept of another thing, from which it must be formed.

This definition has two components. First, a substance is what exists in itself. This is to say that it is an ultimate metaphysical subject. While other things may exist as features of a substance, substance does not exist as a feature of anything else. Second, a substance is what is conceived through itself. This is to say that the idea of a substance does not involve the idea of any other thing. Substances are both ontologically and conceptually independent.

ID4: By attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of a substance, as constituting its essence.

An attribute is not just any property of a substance - it is its very essence. So close is the association of an attribute and the substance of which it is an attribute that Spinoza denies that there is a real distinction between them.

ID5: By mode I understand the affections of a substance, or that which is in another through which it is also conceived.

A mode is what exists in another and is conceived through another. Specifically, it exists as a modification or an affection of a substance and cannot be conceived apart from it. In contrast to substances, modes are ontologically and conceptually dependent.

ID6: By God I understand a being absolutely infinite, that is, a substance consisting of an infinity of attributes, of which each one expresses an eternal and infinite essence.

God is an infinite substance. By this Spinoza means both that the number of God's attributes is unlimited and that there is no attribute that God does not possess. As we make our way through the Ethics, we learn that only two of these attributes can be known by the human mind. These are thought and extension.

ii. Preliminary Propositions

Spinoza moves from these definitions to demonstrate a series of propositions concerning substance in general and God in particular on the basis of which he will demonstrate that God is the one and only substance. The following two propositions are landmarks in the overall argument and are explicitly invoked in the demonstration of IP14:

IP5: In Nature there cannot be two or more substances of the same nature or attribute.

In support of this proposition, Spinoza argues that if two or more substances were to exist they would be differentiated either by a difference in modes or by a difference in attributes. However, they could not be differentiated by a difference in modes, for substances are prior in nature to their modes. Thus, they would have to be differentiated by a difference in attributes. Controversially, Spinoza takes this to entail that no two substances can have exactly the same set of attributes, nor can they have a common attribute. Substances must be entirely dissimilar to one another.

IP11: God, or a substance consisting of infinite attributes, each of which expresses eternal and infinite essence, necessarily exists.

In support of this proposition, Spinoza offers a variant of the so-called Ontological Argument. The basic consideration upon which this variant rests is that it pertains to the nature of substance to exist. Spinoza establishes this earlier, in IP7, by appealing to the fact that substances, being entirely dissimilar to one another, cannot produce one another. Since nothing else can produce a substance, substances must be self-caused, which is to say that it pertains to the nature of substance to exist. To imagine that God does not exist is thus absurd. As a substance consisting of infinite attributes, it pertains to the divine nature to exist.

iii. Substance Monism Demonstrated

With these propositions in place, Spinoza has everything he needs to demonstrate that there is one and only one substance and that this substance is God:

IP14: Except God, no substance can be or be conceived.

The demonstration of this proposition is exceedingly simple. God exists (by IP11). Since God possesses every attribute (by ID6), if any substance other than God were to exist, it would possess an attribute in common with God. But, since there cannot be two or more substances with a common attribute (by IP5), there can be no substance other than God. God is the one and only substance.

The implications of this proposition are startling, and Spinoza can be seen to be working them out through the remainder of the Ethics. Most obviously, this proposition marks a break with the substance pluralism advocated by the majority of philosophers in the west. Even Descartes, from whom Spinoza learned much in the area of metaphysics, posited a plurality of mental and physical substances, along with God, whom he regarded as the paradigm of a substance. More importantly, it signals a rejection of classical theism, the idea that God is the creator of the universe who remains ontologically distinct from it and governs it according to his sovereign will. Spinoza has nothing but scorn for this idea and dismisses it as a product of the imagination. How it is that he reconceptualizes the relation between God, the infinite substance, and the order of finite things, becomes clear only as we turn to his account of the modal system.

b. The Modal System

In line with his rejection of classical theism, Spinoza famously identifies God with Nature. Nature is no longer seen as a power that is distinct from and subordinate to God, but as a power that is one and the same with divine power. Spinoza's phrase 'Deus sive Natura’ (‘God or Nature’) captures this identification and is justly celebrated as a succinct expression of his metaphysics. In isolation, however, the phrase is relatively uninformative. It tells us nothing about how Spinoza, having rejected the creator/creation relation posited by the classical model, conceives of the relation between God and the system of modes.

i. Natura naturans and Natura naturata

To fill out his thoughts on this matter, Spinoza distinguishes between Nature taken in its active or productive aspect, which he identifies with God or the divine attributes, and Nature taken in its derivative or produced aspect, which he identifies with the system of modes. The former he calls Natura naturans(literally: Nature naturing) and the latter he calls Natura naturata (literally: Natura natured). Spinoza's use of these formulas is revealing in two respects. First, his double employment of 'Natura' signals the ontological unity that exists between God and the system of modes. Each mode within the system is a modification of nothing other than the very substance that is God. Second, his employment of the active 'naturans' in the first and the passive 'naturata' in the second signals a causal relation between God and the modal system. God is not merely the subject of modes; he is an active power that produces and sustains them.

In view of the ontological unity that exists between God and the modal system, Spinoza is careful to specify that the divine causality is immanent rather that transitive. What this means is that God's causal activity does not pass outside of the divine substance to produce external effects, as it would if God were a creator in the traditional sense. Rather, it remains wholly within the divine substance to produce the multitude of modes that constitute the modal system. Spinoza likens this to the way in which the nature of a triangle is productive of its own essential properties: "From God's supreme power, or infinite nature, infinitely many things in infinitely many modes, that is, all things, have necessarily flowed, or always follow, by the same necessity and in the same way as from the nature of a triangle it follows, from eternity and to eternity, that its three angles are equal to two right angles" (IP17S1). The entire modal system, Natura naturata, follows immanently from the divine nature, Natura naturans.

ii. Two Types of Mode

Into this relatively simple picture, Spinoza introduces a complication. There are, he says, two types of mode. The first consists in what he calls infinite and eternal modes. These are pervasive features of the universe, each of which follows from the divine nature insofar as it follows from the absolute nature of one or another of God's attributes. Examples include motion and rest under the attribute of extension and infinite intellect under the attribute of thought. The second consists in what may be called finite and temporal modes, which are simply the singular things that populate the universe. Modes of this type follow from the divine nature as well, but do so only as each follows from one or another of God's attributes insofar as it is modified by a modification that is itself finite and temporal. Examples include individual bodies under the attribute of extension and individual ideas under the attribute of thought.

Unfortunately, Spinoza does little to explain either what these infinite and eternal modes are or what relation they have to finite and temporal modes. Taking their cue from a statement in the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect that the laws of nature are embedded in the infinite and eternal modes, many commentators have suggested that Spinoza thought of these modes as governing the manner in which finite modes affect one another. For example, if laws of impact are somehow embedded in the infinite and eternal mode motion and rest, then the outcome of any particular collision will be determined by that mode together with the relevant properties (speed, direction, size, etc) of the bodies involved. If this is correct, then Spinoza envisions every finite mode to be fully determined by intersecting lines of causality: a horizontal line that stretches back through the series of antecedent finite modes and a vertical line that moves up through the series of infinite modes and terminates in one or another of the attributes of God.

iii. Causal Determinism

However it may be that Spinoza ultimately conceives of the relation between infinite and finite modes, he is clear about one thing - the system of modes is an entirely deterministic system in which everything is fully determined to be and to act:

IP29: In nature there is nothing contingent, but all things have been determined from the necessity of the divine nature to exist and produce an effect in a certain way.

Spinoza reminds us that God's existence is necessary. It pertains to the very nature of substance to exist. Furthermore, since each and every mode follows from the necessity of the divine nature, either from the absolute nature of one or another of God's attributes, as is the case with the infinite and eternal modes, or from one or another of God's attributes insofar as it is modified by a modification that is finite, as is the case with the finite modes, they are all necessary as well. Since there is nothing other than the divine substance and its modes, there is nothing that is contingent. Any appearance of contingency is the result of a defect in knowledge, either of God or of the order of causes. Accordingly, Spinoza makes it central to his theory of knowledge that to know a thing adequately is to know it in its necessity, as it has been fully determined by its causes.

iv. Causal Parallelism

An obvious question to ask at this point is whether it is possible for finite modes falling under one attribute to act upon and determine finite modes falling under another attribute. Spinoza's answer is an unambiguous no. Causal relations exist only among modes falling under the same attribute. His explanation for this may be traced back to an axiom set forth at the beginning of Book One:

IA4: The knowledge of an effect depends on, and involves, the knowledge of its cause.

Given this axiom, if a finite mode falling under one attribute were to have God as its cause insofar as he is considered under a different attribute, i.e., if it were to be caused by a finite mode falling under a different attribute, then the knowledge of that mode would involve the knowledge of that other attribute. Since it does not, that mode cannot have God as its cause insofar as he is considered under some other attribute. In other words, it cannot be caused by a finite mode falling under some other attribute.

When applied to modes falling under those attributes of which we have knowledge - thought and extension – this has an enormously important consequence. There can be no causal interaction between ideas and bodies. This does not mean that ideas and bodies are unrelated to one another. Indeed, it is one of the best-known theses in the Ethics that the lines of causation that run among them are strictly parallel:

IIP7: The order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things.

In the demonstration of this proposition Spinoza says that it is a consequence of IA4 and leaves it at that. Nevertheless, it is apparent that this proposition has deep foundations in his substance monism. As thought and extension are not attributes of distinct substances, so ideas and bodies are not modes of distinct substances. They are "one and the same thing, but expressed two ways" (IIP7S). If ideas and bodies are one and the same thing, however, their order and connection must be the same. The doctrine of substance monism in this way insures that ideas and bodies, though causally independent, are causally parallel.

4. Mind and Cognition

It is at this point that Spinoza's metaphysics touches upon his theory of mind and yields some of its most profound consequences. Most obviously, substance monism prohibits him from affirming the kind of dualism that Descartes affirmed, one in which mind and body are conceived as distinct substances. What is more, his contention that modes falling under different attributes have no causal interaction but are causally parallel to one another prohibits him from affirming that mind and body interact. Because he takes seriously the reality of the mental while rejecting dualism and eliminating interaction, Spinoza's views on the mind are generally given a sympathetic hearing in a way that Descartes's views are not.

a. The Mind as the Idea of the Body

To understand Spinoza's account of the mind we must begin with IIP7. This proposition, together with its scholium, commits him to the thesis that for each finite mode of extension there exists a finite mode of thought that corresponds to it and from which it is not really distinct. More elaborately, it commits him to the thesis that (1) for each simple body there exists a simple idea that corresponds to it and from which it is not really distinct and (2) for each composite body there exists a composite idea that corresponds to it and from which it is not really distinct, composed, as it were, of ideas corresponding to each of the bodies of which the composite body is composed. Spinoza counts all of these ideas, whether simple or composite, as minds. In this respect he does not consider the human mind to be unique. It is simply the idea that corresponds to the human body.

In taking this position, Spinoza does not mean to imply that all minds are alike. As minds are expressions of the bodies to which they correspond in the domain of thought, some have abilities that others do not. Simply put, the greater the capacity of a body for acting and being acted upon, the greater the capacity of the mind that corresponds to it for perception. Spinoza elaborates:

[I]n proportion as a body is more capable than others of doing many things at once, or being acted on in many ways at once, so its mind is more capable than others of perceiving many things at once. And in proportion as the actions of a body depend more on itself alone, and as other bodies concur with it less in acting, so its mind is more capable of understanding distinctly. And from these [truths] we know the excellence of one mind over the others. (IIP13S)

Herein lies the explanation of the excellence of the human mind. The human body, as a highly complex composite of many simple bodies, is able to act and be acted upon in myriad ways that other bodies cannot. The human mind, as an expression of that body in the domain of thought, mirrors the body in being a highly complex composite of many simple ideas and is thus possessed of perceptual capacities exceeding those of other, non-human minds. Only a mind that corresponds to a body of complexity comparable to that of the human body can have perceptual abilities comparable to those of the human mind.

b. Imagination

A perceptual ability that is of particular interest to Spinoza is imagination. This he takes to be a general capacity of representing external bodies as present, whether they are actually present or not. Imagination thus includes more than the capacity to form those mental constructs that we normally consider to be imaginative. It includes memory and sense perception as well. Since it is clearly impossible to get around in the world without this, Spinoza concedes that it is "in this way [that] I know almost all the things that are useful in life" (TIE 22).

That being said, Spinoza consistently opposes imagination to intellect and views it as providing no more than confused perception. To use his preferred terminology, the ideas of the imagination are inadequate. They may be essential for getting around in the world, but they give us a distorted and incomplete picture of the things in it. To understand why, it is useful to begin with sense perception. This is the most important form of imaginative perception, and it is from this form that all others derive.

i. Sense Perception

On Spinoza's account, sense perception has its origin in the action of an external body upon one or another of the sensory organs of one's own body. From this there arises a complex series of changes in what amounts to the body’s nervous system. As the mind is the idea of the body, it will represent these changes. This, Spinoza contends, is what constitutes sense perception.

In order to explain how this act of representation yields perception of an external body, Spinoza appeals to the fact that the changed state of one's body is a function both of the nature of one’s body and the nature of the external body that caused that state. Because of this, the mind's representation of that state will express something more than the nature of one's own body. It will express the nature of the external body as well:

IIP16: The idea of any mode in which the human body is affected by external bodies must involve the nature of the human body and at the same time the nature of the external body.

It is this feature of the mind's act of representation - that it expresses the nature of an external body – that explains how such an act constitutes sense perception.

c. Inadequate Ideas

In view of this it is not difficult to see why Spinoza judges sense perception to be inadequate. Grounded as it is in the mind's representation of the state of one’s own body rather than in the direct representation of external bodies, sense perception is indirect. Since this goes for all imaginative ideas, the problem with them all is the same:

IIP16C2: It follows, second, that the ideas which we have of external bodies indicate the condition of our own body more than the nature of the external bodies.

It is because of this that Spinoza refers to the ideas of the imagination as confused. The vision they give of external bodies is unavoidably colored, so to speak, by the lens of one's own body.

Confusion, however, is just one aspect of the inadequacy of imaginative ideas. Such ideas are also mutilated. The reason for this lies in IA4, which states that the knowledge of an effect depends upon and involves the knowledge of its causes. This is a condition that imaginative ideas can never satisfy. The mind may contain the idea of an external body, but it cannot contain ideas of all of the causes of that body. These, being infinite, fall outside of its scope and are fully contained only in God's infinite intellect. God’s ideas of bodies may be adequate, but ours are not. They are cut off from those ideas that are necessary in order to render them adequate.

d. Adequate Ideas

Although imaginative ideas of external bodies are the most important examples of inadequate ideas, they are not the only examples. Spinoza goes on to show that the mind's ideas of the body, its duration, and its parts are all inadequate. So too is the mind's idea of itself. Even so, he remains optimistic about the possibility of adequate ideas.

This optimism becomes evident as Spinoza shifts his attention from imaginative ideas of singular things to intellectual ideas of common things. These common things are things that are either common to all bodies or common to the human body and certain bodies by which the human body is regularly affected. Spinoza tells us little else about these common things, except to say that they are fully present in the whole and in each of the parts of every body in which they are present. Nevertheless, it is fairly certain that the class of things common to all bodies includes the attribute of extension and the infinite and eternal mode of motion and rest. What is included in the class of things common to the human body and those bodies by which the human body is regularly affected is not so certain. Whatever they turn out to be, however, Spinoza assures us that our ideas of them can only be adequate.

To see why, consider some thing, A, that is common to the human body and some body by which the human body is affected. A, Spinoza contends, will be fully present in the affection that arises in the human body as a result of the action of the external body, just as it is in the two bodies themselves. As a result, the mind, in possessing the idea of that affection, not only will have the idea of A, but its idea will be neither confused nor mutilated. The mind's idea of A will be adequate.

This result is of utmost importance. Because any idea that follows from an adequate idea is itself adequate, these ideas, appropriately called common notions, can serve as axioms in a deductive system. When working out this system, the mind engages in a fundamentally different kind of cognition than when it engages in any of the various forms of imaginative perception. In all forms of imaginative perception the order of ideas mirrors the order of bodily affections, and this order, depending as it does upon the chance encounters of the body with external bodies, is entirely fortuitous. By contrast, the derivation of adequate ideas from common notions within a deductive system follows a wholly different order. This Spinoza calls the order of reason. The paradigm case is geometry.

e. Three Kinds of Knowledge

With this distinction between adequate and inadequate perception in place, Spinoza introduces a set of further distinctions. He begins with inadequate perception, which he now calls knowledge of the first kind, and divides it into two parts. The first consists of knowledge from random experience (experientia vaga). This is knowledge "from singular things which have been represented to us through the senses in a way which is mutilated, confused, and without order for the intellect"(P40S2). The second consists of knowledge from signs (ex signis), "for example, from the fact that, having heard or read certain words, we recollect things, and form certain ideas of them, like those through which we imagine the things"(P40S2). What links both of these forms of knowledge is that they lack a rational order. It is obvious that knowledge from random experience follows the order of the affections of the human body, but so does knowledge from signs. A Roman who hears the word 'pomum', for instance, will think of an apple, not because there is any rational connection between the word and the object, but only because they have been associated in his or her experience.

When we reach what Spinoza calls the second kind of knowledge, reason (ratio), we have ascended from an inadequate to an adequate perception of things. This type of knowledge is gained "from the fact that we have common notions and adequate ideas of the properties of things" (P40S2). What Spinoza has in mind here is what was just indicated, namely, the formation of adequate ideas of the common properties of things and the movement by way of deductive inference to the formation of adequate ideas of other common properties. Unlike in the case of knowledge of the first kind, this order of ideas is rational.

We might think that in attaining this second kind of knowledge we have attained all that is available to us. However, Spinoza adds a third type, which he regards as superior. He calls this intuitive knowledge (scientia intuitiva) and tells us that it "proceeds from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God to the adequate knowledge of the [formal] essence of things"(P40S2). Unfortunately, Spinoza is once again obscure at a crucial junction, and it is difficult to know what he has in mind here. He seems to be envisioning a type of knowledge that gives insight into the essence of some singular thing together with an understanding of how that essence follows of necessity from the essence of God. Furthermore, the characterization of this kind of knowledge as intuitive indicates that the connection between the individual essence and the essence of God is grasped in a single act of apprehension and is not arrived at by any kind of deductive process. How this is possible is never explained.

Problems of obscurity aside, we can still see something of the ideal at which Spinoza is aiming. Inadequate ideas are incomplete. Through them we perceive things without perceiving the causes that determine them to be, and it is for this reason that we imagine them to be contingent. What Spinoza is offering with the third kind of knowledge is a way of correcting this. It is important to note, however, that he is not proposing that we can have this knowledge with respect to the durational existence of any particular item. As we have already seen, this would require having ideas of all of the temporal causes of a thing, which are infinite. Rather, he is proposing that we can have it with respect to the essence of a singular thing as it follows from the essence of God. To have this kind of knowledge is to understand the thing as necessary rather than contingent. It is, to use Spinoza's famous phrase, to regard it sub quadam specie aeternitatis, under a certain aspect of eternity.

5. Psychology

One of the most interesting but understudied areas of Spinoza's thought is his psychology, the centerpiece of which is his theory of the affects. Spinoza, of course, was not the first philosopher to take an interest in the affects. He had only to look to the work of Descartes and Hobbes in the previous generation and to the work of the Stoics before them to find sustained discussions of the topic. His own work shows that he learned much from these thinkers.

Despite his debts, Spinoza expressed deep dissatisfaction with the views of those who had preceded him. His dissatisfaction reflects the naturalistic orientation that he wished to bring to the subject:

Most of those who have written about the affects, and men's way of living, seem to treat, not of natural things, which follow the common laws of Nature, but of things which are outside Nature. Indeed they seem to conceive man in Nature as a dominion within a dominion. For they believe that man disturbs, rather than follows, the order of Nature, that he has absolute power over his actions, and that he is determined only by himself. (III Preface)

In opposition to what he saw as a tendency on the part of previous philosophers to treat humans as exceptions to the natural order, Spinoza proposes to treat them as subject to the same laws and causal determinants as everything else. What emerges can best be described as a mechanistic theory of the affects.

a. Rejection of Free-Will

In working out this new perspective, the first thing on Spinoza's agenda is to clear away what he sees as the most pervasive confusion that we as humans have about ourselves. This is the belief in free-will. Spinoza has nothing but scorn for this belief and treats it as a delusion that arises from the fact that the ideas we have of our actions are inadequate. "[M]en believe themselves to be free," he writes, “because they are conscious of their own actions and are ignorant of the causes by which they are determined" (IIIP2S). If we were to acquire adequate ideas of our actions, since these would carry with them knowledge of their causes, we would immediately see this belief as the delusion that it is.

Spinoza's position on this matter is quite obviously dictated by the determinism of his metaphysics. The mind, as a finite mode, is fully determined to be and to act by other finite modes. To posit a faculty of will by which it is made autonomous and independent of external causal determinants is to remove it from nature. Spinoza will have none of this. As it is fully part of nature, the mind must be understood according to the same principles that govern all modes.

b. The Conatus Principle

The first and most important of these principles is what has come to be known as the Conatus Principle:

IIIP6: Each thing, as far as it can by its own power, strives to persevere in being.

The correct interpretation of this principle is far from clear, but it appears to posit a kind of existential inertia within modes. Each mode, to the extent of its power, so acts as to resist the destruction or diminution of its being. Spinoza expresses this by saying that each mode has an innate striving (conatus) to persevere in being. This striving is so central to what a mode is that he identifies it as a mode's very essence:

IIIP7: The striving by which each thing strives to persevere in its being is nothing but the actual essence of the thing.

Though a bit mysterious as to what it means to say that the striving of a mode is its essence, this identification will play a key role in Spinoza's ethical theory. Among other things, it will provide the basis upon which he can determine what is involved in living by the guidance of reason.

c. The Affects

Spinoza begins his account of the affects with those that result from the action of external causes upon the mind. These are the passive affects, or passions. He identifies three as primary - joy, sadness, and desire – and characterizes all others as involving a combination of one or more of these together with some kind of cognitive state. Love and hate, for example, are joy and sadness coupled with an awareness of their respective causes. Longing, for example, is desire coupled with a memory of the desired object and an awareness of its absence. All remaining passions are characterized in a similar fashion.

Although joy, sadness, and desire are primitive, they are each defined in relation to the mind's striving for perseverance. Joy is that affect by which the mind passes to a greater perfection, understood as an increased power of striving. Sadness is that affect by which the mind passes to a lesser perfection, understood as a decreased power of striving. And desire is the striving for perseverance itself insofar as the mind is conscious of it. Because all passions are derived from these primary affects, the entire passional life of the mind is thus defined in relation to the striving for perseverance.

This may seem paradoxical. Insofar as the mind strives to persevere in being it would appear to be active rather than passive. This is true, but we must realize that the mind strives both insofar as it has adequate ideas and insofar as it has inadequate ideas. The passions are defined only in relation to the mind's striving insofar as it has inadequate ideas. In fact, the passions are themselves a species of inadequate ideas. And since all inadequate ideas are caused from without, so too are the passions. It is in this respect that they must be considered to be passive rather than active.

This, however, is not the case with those affects that are defined in relation to the mind's striving insofar as it has adequate ideas. All such affects, being themselves a species of adequate ideas, are active. Mirroring his analysis of the passions, Spinoza takes two of these as primitive - active joy and active desire – and treats the remainder as derivative. (He does not acknowledge the possibility of an active form of sadness, since the diminishment of the mind's perfection, which is what is involved in sadness, can only occur through the action of external causes.) In doing so, he posits an element within the affective life that is not only active, but, because it is grounded in the mind's striving insofar as it has adequate ideas, is fully rational. It is a central concern of Spinoza's ethical program to maximize this element.

d. Bondage

That Spinoza would wish to maximize the active affects is understandable in light of his characterization of life led under the sway of the passions. Such a life is one in which the individual exercises little effective self-control and is buffeted by external circumstances in ways that are largely random. "The man who is subject to the [passive] affects," Spinoza writes, "is under the control, not of himself, but of fortune, in whose power he so greatly is that often, though he sees the better for himself, he is still forced to follow the worse" (IV Preface). Life under the sway of the passions is a life of bondage.

Unfortunately, the extent to which we can extricate ourselves from the sway of the passions is limited. There are two reasons for this. The first is that the mind is a mode of limited power, yet it is inserted into an order of nature in which there exists an infinite number of modes whose power surpasses its own. To think that the mind can exist unaffected within this order is to assume, falsely, that it is endowed with infinite power or that nothing in nature acts upon it. The second, which is a specification of the first, is that an affect is not restrained merely because it is opposed by reason. It must be opposed by an affect that is stronger than it. The trouble is that reason often lacks this affective power. This is because the strength of the active affects, which pertain to reason, is a function of the strength of the mind alone, whereas the strength of the passive affects, the passions, is a function of the strength of their external causes, which in many cases is greater. In such cases reason is unable to overrule passion and is impotent as a guide. "With this," Spinoza concludes, “I have shown the cause why men are moved more by opinion than by true reason, and why the true knowledge of good and evil arouses disturbances of the mind, and often yields to lust of every kind" (IV17S). Such is the life of bondage.

6. Ethics

It is from this rather pessimistic diagnosis of the human condition that Spinoza's ethical theory takes off. In view of this, it is not at all surprising that his ethics is largely one of liberation, a liberation that is directly tied to the cultivation of reason. In this respect, Spinoza's ethical orientation is much more akin to that of the ancients than to that of his fellow moderns. Like the ancients, he sought not so much to analyze the nature and source of moral duty as to describe the ideal human life. This is the life that is lived by the so-called 'free-man'. It is a life of one who lives by the guidance of reason rather than under the sway of the passions.

a. Freedom from the Passions

In the opening propositions of Book Five, Spinoza lists a number of respects in which the mind, despite its condition of bondage, is able to weaken the hold that the passions have over it. Generally speaking, it is able to do this insofar as it acquires adequate ideas. This, Spinoza tells us, is due to the fact that "the power of the mind is defined by knowledge alone, whereas lack of power, or passion, is judged solely by the privation of knowledge, that is, by that through which ideas are called inadequate" (VP20S). Two examples illustrate this liberating power of adequate ideas.

First, Spinoza claims that the mind is able to form adequate ideas of its affects. It can thus form adequate ideas of the passions, which are themselves inadequate ideas. Since there is no real distinction between an idea and the idea of that idea, those passions of which the mind forms adequate ideas are thereby dissolved.

Second, the effect of a thing upon the mind is lessened to the extent that it is understood to be necessary rather than contingent. We tend, for example, to be saddened less by the loss of a good when we understand that its loss was inevitable. Similarly, we tend to be angered less by another person's actions when we understand that he or she could not have done otherwise. Since adequate ideas present things as necessary rather than as contingent, the acquisition of such ideas thereby lessens their effect upon the mind.

As these examples illustrate, the mind's power over the passions is a function of the adequate ideas that it possess. Liberation lies in the acquisition of knowledge, which empowers the mind and renders it less susceptible to external circumstances. In taking this position, Spinoza places himself in a long tradition that stretches back to the Stoics and ultimately to Socrates.

b. Conatus and the Guidance of Reason

Spinoza tells us that the model human life - the life lived by the 'free-man' – is one that is lived by the guidance of reason rather than under the sway of the passions. This tells us very little, however, unless we know what it is that reason prescribes. In order to make this determination, Spinoza falls back upon the mind's striving for perseverance:

Since reason demands nothing contrary to Nature, it demands that everyone love himself, seek his own advantage, what is really useful to him, want what will really lead a man to greater perfection, and absolutely, that everyone should strive to preserve his own being as far as he can. This, indeed, is as necessarily true as that the whole is greater than its part. (IVP18S)

Reason's prescription is egoistic. We are to act in accordance with our nature. But since our nature is identical to our striving to persevere in being, reason prescribes that we do whatever is to our advantage and seek whatever aids us in our striving. To act this way, Spinoza insists, is to act virtuously.

This does not mean that in living by the guidance of reason we necessarily place ourselves at odds with others. Reason prescribes that individuals seek whatever aids in the striving for perseverance. But since the goods that are necessary in order to persevere in being are attainable only within the context of social life, reason dictates that we act in ways that are conducive to the stability and harmony of society. Spinoza goes so far as to say that in a society in which everyone lives by the guidance of reason, there would be no need of political authority to restrict action. It is only insofar as individuals live under the sway of the passions that they come into conflict with one another and are in need of political authority. Those who live by the guidance of reason understand this and recognize that authority as legitimate.

c. Knowledge of God as the Highest Good

Spinoza's contention that those who live by the guidance of reason will naturally live in harmony with one another receives some support from his view of the highest good for a human. This is the knowledge of God. Since this knowledge can be possessed equally by all who seek it, it can be sought by all without drawing any into conflict.

To establish that the knowledge of God is the highest good, Spinoza again appeals to the fact that the mind's striving is its essence. Since what follows from the mind's essence alone are adequate ideas, this allows him to construe the mind's striving as a striving for adequate ideas. It is a striving for understanding:

IVP26: What we strive for from reason is nothing but understanding; nor does the mind, insofar as it uses reason, judge anything else useful to itself except what leads to understanding.

From here it is but an easy step to show that the knowledge of God is the mind's greatest good. As an infinite substance, God is the greatest thing that can be conceived. Moreover, since everything other than God is a mode of God, and since modes can neither be nor be conceived without the substance of which they are modes, nothing else can be or be conceived apart from God. Spinoza concludes:

IVP28: Knowledge of God is the mind's greatest good: its greatest virtue is to know God.

The knowledge of God is the fulfillment of the mind's striving to persevere in being.

d. Intellectual Love of God and Human Blessedness

In elaborating this thesis, Spinoza specifies this knowledge as knowledge of the third kind. This is the knowledge that proceeds from the adequate idea of one or another of God's attributes to the adequate idea of the formal essence of some singular thing that follows from that attribute. When we possess knowledge of the third kind, we possess adequate perception of God's essence considered not only in itself, but as the immanent causal power of the particular modifications to which it is subject. Knowledge of the first kind, because it is inadequate, and knowledge of the second kind, because it is restricted to the common properties of things, both fail to give us this.

In attaining the third kind of knowledge the mind passes to the highest state of perfection that is available to it. As a result, it experiences active joy to the greatest possible degree. More importantly, since it is by this kind of knowledge that the mind understands God to be the cause of its own perfection, it gives rise to an active love for God as well. This Spinoza refers to as the intellectual love of God. It is the affective correlate to the third kind of knowledge.

The intellectual love of God turns out to have a great many unique properties. Among other things, it is entirely constant, it has no contraries, and it is the very love by which God loves himself. Most significantly, it constitutes the blessedness of the one who possesses it. When such a love dominates one's affective life, one attains the serenity and freedom from passion that is the mark of wisdom. Spinoza thus writes of the person who has attained this love that he "is hardly troubled in spirit, but being, by a certain eternal necessity, conscious of himself, and of God, and of things, he never ceases to be, but always possess true peace of mind" (VP42S). This is human blessedness.

e. Eternity of the Mind

Spinoza's comment that a person who has attained the intellectual love of God "never ceases to be" is perplexing to say the least. It signals a commitment to the view that in some fashion or another the mind, or some part of it, survives the death of the body:

VP23: The human mind cannot be absolutely destroyed with the body, but something of it remains which is eternal.

At first sight, this appears to be in violation of Spinoza's anti-dualist contention that mind and body are one and the same thing conceived under two different attributes. On the basis of this contention, one would expect him to reject the survival of the mind in any fashion. That he asserts it instead has understandably been a source of great controversy among his commentators.

At least some of the problem can be cleared away by taking account of a crucial distinction that Spinoza makes between the existence of the body and its essence. The existence of the body is its actual duration through time. This involves its coming to be, the changes it undergoes within its environment, and its eventual destruction. By contrast, the essence of the body is non-durational. It is grounded in the timeless essence of God, specifically as one among the innumerable particular ways of being extended.

The importance of this distinction lies in the fact that, by appealing to the parallelism doctrine, Spinoza can conclude that there is a corresponding distinction with respect to the mind. There is an aspect of the mind that is the expression of the existence of the body, and there is an aspect of the mind that is the expression of the essence of the body. Spinoza readily concedes that the aspect of the mind that expresses the existence of the body cannot survive the destruction of the body. It is destroyed with the destruction of the body. Such, however, is not the fate of the aspect of the mind that expresses the essence of the body. Like its object, this aspect of the mind is non-durational. Since only what is durational ceases to be, this aspect of the mind is unaffected by the destruction of the body. It is eternal.

Here we must be careful not to misunderstand what Spinoza is saying. In particular, we should not take him to be offering anything approaching a full-blooded doctrine of personal immortality. In fact, he dismisses the belief in personal immortality as arising from confusion: "If we attend to the common opinion of men, we shall see that they are indeed conscious of the eternity of their mind, but that they confuse it with duration, and attribute it to the imagination, or memory, which they believe remains after death" (VP34S). Individuals have some awareness of the eternity of their own minds. But they mistakenly believe that this eternity pertains to the durational aspect of the mind, the imagination. As it is the imagination, inclusive of memory, that constitutes one's unique identity as a person, the belief in personal immortality is similarly mistaken.

None of this is to say that Spinoza's doctrine of the eternity of the mind has no relevance to ethics. Although the imagination is not eternal, the intellect is. And since the intellect is constituted by the mind's store of adequate ideas, the mind is eternal precisely to the extent that it has these ideas. As a consequence, a person whose mind is constituted largely by adequate ideas participates more fully in eternity than a person whose mind is constituted largely by inadequate ideas. So, while Spinoza offers us no hope of personal immortality, we may take consolation in the fact that "death is less harmful to us, the greater the mind's clear and distinct knowledge, and hence, the more the mind loves God" (VP38S).

f. Conclusion

Spinoza does not pretend that any of this is easy. The acquisition of adequate ideas, especially those by which we attain knowledge of the third kind, is difficult, and we can never completely escape the influence of the passions. Nevertheless, Spinoza holds out to those who make the effort the promise, not of personal immortality, but of participation in eternity within this life. He closes the Ethics with these words:

If the way I have shown to lead to these things now seems very hard, still, it can be found. And of course, what is found so rarely must be hard. For if salvation were at hand, and could be found without great effort, how could nearly everyone neglect it? But all things excellent are as difficult as they are rare. (VP42S)

7. References and Further Reading

All passages from the texts of Spinoza are taken from the translations appearing in The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol.I. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985). Passages from the Ethics are cited according to Book (I - V), Definition (D), Axiom (A), Proposition (P), Corollary (C), and Scholium (S). (IVP13S) refers to Ethics, Book IV, Proposition 13, Scholium. Passages from the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect are cited according to paragraph number. (TIE 35) refers to Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, paragraph 35.

All passages from the texts of Descartes are taken from the translations appearing in The Philosophical Writings of Descartes. 2 Vols. Edited and translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff & Dugald Murdoch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985). Passages are cited according to volume and page number. (CSM II,23) refers to Cottingham, Stoothoff & Murdoch, Volume II, page 23.

a. Texts and Translations of Spinoza

  • Spinoza Opera. 4 Vols. Edited by Carl Gebhart. (Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925).
    • Standard critical edition of Spinoza's writings and correspondence in Latin and Dutch.
  • The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol. I. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton University Press, 1985).
    • First of two volumes (the second is not yet complete) in what, when complete, will become the standard translation into English of Spinoza's writings and correspondence.
  • A Spinoza Reader: The Ethics and Other Works. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1994).
    • Useful reader that contains the entire text of the Ethics, as well as substantial selections from the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, the Short Treatise, and theTheological-Political Treatise. Also contains helpful selections from Spinoza's correspondence.
  • Baruch Spinoza: The Complete Works. Edited by Michael L. Morgan and translated by Samuel Shirley. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 2002).
    • Only modern translation into English of Spinoza's complete works, including his correspondence.

b. General Studies Suitable as Introductions

  • Allison, Henry. Benedict de Spinoza: An Introduction. (New Haven: Yale UP, 1987).
  • Curley, Edwin. Behind the Geometrical Method. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988).
  • Lloyd, Genevieve. Spinoza and the "Ethics". (London: Routledge, 1996).
  • Hampshire, Stuart. Spinoza. (London: Penguin, 1951).
  • Steinberg, Diane, On Spinoza. (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2000).

c. More Advanced and Specialized Studies

  • Bennett, Jonathan. A Study of Spinoza's "Ethics". (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1984).
  • De Dijn, Herman. Spinoza: The Way to Wisdom. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 1996).
  • Della Rocca, Michael. Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996).
  • Donagan, Alan. Spinoza. (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988). Curley, Edwin. Spinoza's Metaphysics: An Essay in Interpretation. (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1969).
  • Delahunty, R.J. Spinoza. (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1985).
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, Part of Nature: Self-Knowledge in Spinoza's Ethics. (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1994).
  • Mark, Thomas Carson. Spinoza's Theory of Truth. (New York: Columbia University Press, 1972).
  • Mason, Richard. The God of Spinoza: A Philosophical Study. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997).
  • Nadler, Steven. Spinoza: A Life. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999).
  • Nadler, Steven. Spinoza's Heresy. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001).
  • Wolfson, Harry Austryn. The Philosophy of Spinoza. 2 Vols. (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1934).
  • Woolhouse, R.S. Descartes, Spinoza, Leibniz: The Concept of Substance in Seventeenth Century Metaphysics. (London: Routledge, 1993).
  • Yovel, Yrmiyahu, Spinoza and Other Heretics. Vol.I: The Marrano of Reason; Vol.II: The Adventures of Immanence. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1989).

d. Collected Essays on Spinoza

  • Chappell, Vere (ed.). Baruch de Spinoza. (New York: Garland Publishing, 1992).
  • Curley, Edwin and Pierre-François Moreau (eds.). Spinoza: Issues and Directions. (Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1990).
  • Freeman, Eugene and Maurice Mandelbaum (eds.). Spinoza: Essays in Interpretation. (LaSalle, IL: Open Court, 1975).
  • Garrett, Don (ed.). The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996).
  • Grene, Marjorie (ed.). Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays. (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973).
  • Grene, Marjorie and Debra Nails (eds.). Spinoza and the Sciences. (Dordrecht: Reidel, 1986).
  • Kennington, Richard (ed.). The Philosophy of Baruch Spinoza. (Washington DC: Catholic University Press, 1980).
  • Lloyd, Genevieve (ed.). Spinoza Critical Assessments, 4 Vols. (London: Routledge, 2001).
  • Shanan, Robert and J.I. Biro (eds.). Spinoza: New Perspectives. (Norman, OK: University of Oklahoma Press, 1978).

Author Information

Blake D. Dutton
Email: bdutton@luc.edu
Loyola University Chicago
U. S. A.

Ayn Alissa Rand (1905—1982)

randAyn Rand was a major intellectual of the twentieth century. Born in Russia in 1905 and educated there, she immigrated to the United States after graduating from the university, where she studied history, politics, philosophy, and literature. Rand had always found capitalism and the individualism of the United States a welcome alternative to the corrupt and negative socialism of Russia. Upon becoming proficient in English and establishing herself as a writer in the U.S., she became a passionate advocate of her philosophy, Objectivism.

Rand’s philosophy is in the Aristotelian tradition, with that tradition’s emphasis upon metaphysical naturalism, empirical reason in epistemology, and self-realization in ethics.  Objectivism is rational self-interest and self-responsibility – the idea that no person is any other person’s slave. The virtues of her philosophy are principled policies based on rational assessment: rationality, productiveness, honesty (in order to rationally make the best decisions we must be privy to the facts), integrity, independence, justice, and pride.

Her political philosophy is in the classical liberal tradition, with that tradition’s emphasis upon individualism, the constitutional protection of individual rights to life, liberty, and property, and limited government.

She wrote both technical and popular works of philosophy, and she presented her philosophy in both fictional and non-fictional forms, the most philosophically complete and popular of which are Atlas Shrugged and Fountainhead. Her philosophy has influenced several generations of academics and public intellectuals, as well as having had widespread popular appeal.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Rand's Ethical Theory: The Virtue of Selfishness
    1. Reason and Ethics
    2. Conflicts of Interest
  3. Rand's Influence
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Ayn Rand's life was often as colorful as those of her heroes in her best-selling novels The Fountainhead and Atlas Shrugged. Rand first made her name as a novelist, publishing We the Living in 1936, The Fountainhead in 1943, and her magnum opus Atlas Shrugged in 1957. These philosophical novels embodied themes she then developed in non-fiction form in a series of essays and books written in the 1960s and 1970s.

Born in St. Petersburg, Russia, on February 2, 1905, Rand was raised in a middle-class family. As a child, she loved story-telling, and she decided at age nine to become a writer. In school she showed academic promise, particularly in mathematics. Her family was devastated by the communist revolution of 1917, both by the social upheavals that the revolution and the ensuing civil war brought and by her father's pharmacy's being confiscated by the Soviets. The family moved to the Crimea to recover financially and to escape the harshness of life the revolution brought to St. Petersburg. They later returned to Petrograd (the new name given to St. Petersburg by the Soviets), where Rand was to attend university.

At the University of Petrograd, Rand concentrated her studies on history, with secondary focuses on philosophy and literature. At university, she was repelled by the dominance of communist ideas and strong-arm tactics that suppressed free inquiry and discussion. As a youth, she had been repelled by the communists' political program, and now an adult, she was also more fully aware of the destructive effects that the revolution had had on Russian society more broadly.

Having studied American history and politics in university, and having long been an admirer of Western plays, music, and movies, she became an admirer of America's individualism, its vigor, and its optimism, seeing it as the opposite of Russian collectivism, decay, and gloom. Not believing, however, that she would be free under the Soviet system to write the kinds of books she wanted to write, she resolved to leave Russia and go to America.

Rand graduated from the University of Petrograd in 1924. She then enrolled at the State Institute for Cinema Arts in order to study screen writing. In 1925, she finally received permission from the Soviet authorities to leave the country in order to visit relatives in the United States. Officially, her visit was to be brief; Rand, however, had already decided not to return to the Soviet Union.

After several stops in western European cities, Rand arrived in New York City in February 1926. From New York, she traveled on to Chicago, Illinois, where she spent the next six months living with relatives, learning English, and developing ideas for stories and movies. She had decided to become a screenwriter, and, having received an extension to her visa, she left for Hollywood, California.

On Rand's second day in Hollywood, an event occurred that was worthy of her dramatic fiction and one that had a major impact on her future. She was spotted by Cecil B. DeMille, one of Hollywood's leading directors, while she was standing at the gate of his studio. She had recognized him as he was passing by in his car, and he had noticed her staring at him. He stopped to ask why she was staring, and Rand explained that she had recently arrived from Russia, that she had long been passionate about Hollywood movies, and that she dreamed of being a screen writer. DeMille was then working on "The King of Kings," and gave her a ride to his movie set and signed her on as an extra. Then, during her second week at DeMille's studio, another significant event occurred: Rand met Frank O'Connor, a young actor also working as an extra. Rand and O'Connor were married in 1929, and they remained married for fifty years until his death in 1979.

Rand also worked for DeMille as a reader of scripts, and struggled financially while working on her own writing. She also held a variety of non-writing jobs until in 1932 she was able to sell her first screenplay, "Red Pawn," to Universal Studios. Also in 1932 her first stage play, "Night of January 16th," was produced in Hollywood and later on Broadway.

Rand had been working for years on her first significant novel, We the Living, and finished it in 1933. However, for several years it was rejected by various publishers, until in 1936 it was published by Macmillan in the U.S. and Cassell in England. Rand described We the Living as the most autobiographical of her novels, its theme being the brutality of life under communist rule in Russia. We the Living did not receive a positive reaction from American reviewers and intellectuals. It was published in the 1930s, a decade sometimes called the "Red Decade," during which American intellectuals were often pro-Communist and respectful and admiring of the Soviet experiment.

Rand's next major project was The Fountainhead, which she had begun to work on in 1935. While the theme of We the Living was political, the theme of The Fountainhead was ethical, focusing on individualist themes of independence and integrity. The novel's hero, the architect Howard Roark, is Rand's first embodiment of her ideal man, the man who lives on a principled and heroic scale of achievement.

As with We the Living, Rand had difficulties getting The Fountainhead published. Twelve publishers rejected it before being published by Bobbs-Merrill in 1943. Again not well received by reviewers and intellectuals, the novel nonetheless became a best-seller, primarily through word-of-mouth recommendation. The Fountainhead made Rand famous as an exponent of individualist ideas, and its continuing to sell well brought her financial security. Warner Brothers produced a movie version of the novel in 1949, starring Gary Cooper and Patricia Neal, for which Rand wrote the screenplay.

In 1946, Rand began work on her most ambitious novel, Atlas Shrugged. At the time she was working part-time as a screenwriter for producer Hal Wallis. In 1951 she and her husband moved to New York City, where she began to work full-time on Atlas. Published by Random House in 1957, Atlas Shrugged is her most complete expression of her literary and philosophical vision. Dramatized in the form of a mystery story about a man who stopped the motor of the world, the plot and characters embody the political and ethical themes first developed in We the Living and The Fountainhead, and integrates them into a comprehensive philosophy including metaphysics, epistemology, economics, and the psychology of love and sex.

Atlas Shrugged was an immediate best-seller and Rand's last work of fiction. Her novels had expressed philosophical themes, although Rand considered herself primarily a novelist and only secondarily a philosopher. The creation of plots and characters and the dramatization of achievements and conflicts were her central purposes in writing fiction, rather than presenting an abstracted and didactic set of philosophical theses.

The Fountainhead and Atlas Shrugged, however, had attracted to Rand many readers who were strongly interested in the philosophical ideas the novels embodied and in pursuing them further. Among the earliest of those with whom Rand became associated and who later became prominent were psychologist Nathaniel Branden and economist Alan Greenspan, later Chairman of the Federal Reserve. Her interactions with these and several other key individuals were partly responsible for Rand's turning from fiction to non-fiction writing in order to develop her philosophy more systematically.

From 1962 until 1976, Rand wrote and lectured on her philosophy, now named "Objectivism." Her essays were during this period were mostly published in a series of periodicals, The Objectivist Newsletter, published from 1962 to 1965, the larger periodical The Objectivist, published from 1966 to 1971, and then The Ayn Rand Letter, published from 1971 to 1976. The essays written for these periodicals form the core material for a series of nine non-fiction books published during Rand's lifetime. Those books develop Rand's philosophy in all its major categories and apply it to cultural issues. Perhaps the most significant of the books are The Virtue of Selfishness, which develops her ethical theory, Capitalism: The Unknown Ideal, devoted to political and economic theory, Introduction to Objectivist Epistemology, a systematic presentation of her theory of concepts, and The Romantic Manifesto, a theory of aesthetics.

During the 1960s Rand's most significant professional relationship was with Nathaniel Branden. Branden, author of The Psychology of Self-Esteem and later known as a leader in the self-esteem movement in psychology, wrote many essays on philosophical and psychological topics that were published in Rand's books and periodicals. He was the founder and head of the Nathaniel Branden Institute, the leading Objectivist institution of the 1960s. Based in New York City, N.B.I. published with Rand's sanction numerous Objectivist periodicals and pamphlets, and gave many series of lectures live in New York which were then distributed on tape around the United States and the rest of the world. The rapid growth of N.B.I. and the Objectivist movement came to a halt in 1968 when, for both professional and personal reasons, Rand and Branden parted ways.

Rand continued to write and lecture consistently until she stopped publishing The Ayn Rand Letter in 1976. Thereafter she wrote and lectured less as her husband's health declined, leading to his death in 1979, and as her own health began to decline. Rand died on March 6, 1982, in her New York City apartment.

2. Rand’s Ethical Theory: The Virtue of Selfishness

The provocative title of Ayn Rand's The Virtue of Selfishness matches an equally provocative thesis about ethics. Traditional ethics has always been suspicious of self interest, praising acts that are selfless in intent and calling amoral or immoral acts that are motivated by self interest. A self-interested person, on the traditional view, will not consider the interests of others and so will slight or harm those interests in the pursuit of his own.

Rand's view is that the exact opposite is true: self-interest, properly understood, is the standard of morality and selflessness is the deepest immorality.

Self interest rightly understood, according to Rand, is to see oneself as an end in oneself. That is to say that one's own life and happiness are one's highest values, and that one does not exist as a servant or slave to the interests of others. Nor do others exist as servants or slaves to one's own interests. Each person's own life and happiness is his ultimate end. Self interest rightly understood also entails self-responsibility: one's life is one's own, and so is the responsibility for sustaining and enhancing it. It is up to each of us to determine what values our lives require, how best to achieve those values, and to act to achieve those values.

Rand's ethic of self interest is integral to her advocacy of classical liberalism. Classical liberalism, more often called "libertarianism" in the 20th century, is the view that individuals should be free to pursue their own interests. This implies, politically, that governments should be limited to protecting each individual's freedom to do so. In other words, the moral legitimacy of self interest implies that individuals have rights to their lives, their liberties, their property, and the pursuit of their own happiness, and that the purpose of government is to protect those rights. Economically, leaving individuals free to pursue their own interests implies in turn that only a capitalist or free market economic system is moral: free individuals will use their time, money, and other property as they see fit, and will interact and trade voluntarily with others to mutual advantage.

a. Reason and Ethics

Fundamentally, the means by which we live our lives as humans is reason. Our capacity for reason is what enables us to survive and flourish. We are not born knowing what is good for us; that is learned. Nor are we born knowing how to achieve what is good for us; that too is learned. It is by reason that we learn what is food and what is poison, what animals are useful or dangerous to us, how to make tools, what forms of social organization are fruitful, and so on.

Thus Rand advocates rational self interest: one's interests are not whatever one happens to feel like; rather it is by reason that one identifies what is to one's interest and what isn't. By the use of reason one takes into account all of the factors one can identify, projects the consequences of potential courses of action, and adopts principled policies of action.

The principled policies a person should adopt are called virtues. A virtue is an acquired character trait; it results from identifying a policy as good and committing to acting consistently in terms of that policy.

One such virtue is rationality: having identified the use of reason as fundamentally good, being committed to acting in accordance with reason is the virtue of rationality. Another virtue is productiveness: given that the values one needs to survive must be produced, being committed to producing those values is the virtue of productiveness. Another is honesty: given that facts are facts and that one's life depends on knowing and acting in accordance with the facts, being committed to awareness of the facts is the virtue of honesty.

Independence and integrity are also core virtues for Rand's account of self interest. Given that one must think and act by one's own efforts, being committed to the policy of independent action is a virtue. And given that one must both identify what is to one's interests and act to achieve them, a policy of being committed to acting on the basis of one's beliefs is the virtue of integrity. The opposite policy of believing one thing and doing another is of course the vice of hypocrisy; hypocrisy is a policy of self-destruction, on Rand's view.

Justice is another core self-interested virtue: justice, on Rand's account, means a policy of judging people, including oneself, according to their value and acting accordingly. The opposite policy of giving to people more or less than they deserve is injustice. The final virtue on Rand's list of core virtues is pride, the policy of "moral ambitiousness," in Rand's words. This means a policy of being committed to making oneself be the best one can be, of shaping one's character to the highest level possible.

The moral person, in summary, on Rand's account, is someone who acts and is committed to acting in his best self-interest. It is by living the morality of self interest that one survives, flourishes, and achieves happiness.

This account of self interest is currently a minority position. The contrasting view typically pits self interest against morality, holding that one is moral only to the extent that one sacrifices one's self interest for the sake of others or, more moderately, to the extent one acts primarily with regard to the interests of others. For example, standard versions of morality will hold that one is moral to the extent one sets aside one's own interests in order to serve God, or the weak and the poor, or society as a whole. On these accounts, the interests of God, the poor, or society as a whole are held to be of greater moral significance that one's own, and so accordingly one's interests should be sacrificed when necessary. These ethics of selflessness thus believe that one should see oneself fundamentally as a servant, as existing to serve the interests of others, not one's own. "Selfless service to others" or "selfless sacrifice" are stock phrases indicating these accounts' view of appropriate motivation and action.

The core difference between Rand's self interest view and the selfless view can be seen in the reason why most advocates of selflessness think self interest is dangerous: conflicts of interest.

b. Conflicts of Interest

Traditional ethics takes conflicts of interest to be fundamental to the human condition, and takes ethics to be the solution: basic ethical principles are to tell us whose interests should be sacrificed in order to resolve the conflicts. If there is, for example, a fundamental conflict between what God wants and what humans naturally want, then religious ethics will make fundamental the principle that human wants should be sacrificed for God's. If there's a fundamental conflict between what society needs and what individuals want, then some versions of secular ethics will make fundamental the principle that the individual's wants should be sacrificed for society's.

Taking conflicts of interest to be fundamental almost always stems from one of two beliefs: that human nature is fundamentally destructive or that economic resources are scarce. If human nature is fundamentally destructive, then humans are naturally in conflict with each other. Many ethical philosophies start from this premise - for example, Plato's myth of Gyges, Jewish and Christian accounts of Original Sin, or Freud's account of the id. If what individuals naturally want to do to each other is rape, steal, and kill, then in order to have society these individual desires need to be sacrificed. Consequently, a basic principle of ethics will be to urge individuals to suppress their natural desires so that society can exist. In other words, self interest is the enemy, and must be sacrificed for others.

If economic resources are scarce, then there is not enough to go around. This scarcity then puts human beings in fundamental conflict with each other: for one individual's need to be satisfied, another's must be sacrificed. Many ethical philosophies begin with this premise. For example, followers of Thomas Malthus's theory that population growth outstrips growth in the food supply fall into this category. Karl Marx's account of capitalist society is that brutal competition leads to the exploitation of some by others. Garret Hardin's famous use of the lifeboat analogy asks us to imagine that society is like a lifeboat with more people that its resources can support. And so in order to solve the destructive competition the lack of resources leads us to, a basic principle of ethics will be to urge individuals to sacrifice their interests in obtaining more (or even some) so that others may obtain more (or some) and society can exist peacefully. In others words, in a situation of scarcity self interest is the enemy and must be sacrificed for others.

Rand rejects both the scarce resources and destructive human nature premises. Human beings are not born in sin or with destructive desires; nor do they necessarily acquire them in the course of growing to maturity. Instead one is born tabula rasa ("blank slate"), and through one's choices and actions one acquires one's character traits and habits. As Rand phrased it, "Man is a being of self-made soul." Having chronic desires to steal, rape, or kill others are the result of mistaken development and the acquisition of bad habits, just as are chronic laziness or the habit of eating too much junk food. And just as one is not born lazy but can by one's choices develop oneself into a person of vigor or sloth, one is not born anti-social but can by one's choices develop oneself into a person of cooperativeness or conflict.

Nor are resources scarce in any fundamental way, according to Rand. By the use of reason, humans can discover new resources and how to use existing resources more efficiently, including recycling where appropriate and making productive processes more efficient. Humans have for example continually discovered and developed new energy resources, from animals to wood to coal to oil to nuclear to solar; and there is no end in sight to this process. At any given moment, the available resources are a fixed amount, but over time the stock of resources are and have been constantly expanding.

Because humans are rational they can produce an ever-expanding number of goods, and so human interests do not fundamentally conflict with each other. Instead Rand holds that the exact opposite is true: since humans can and should be productive, human interests are deeply in harmony with each other. For example, my producing more corn is in harmony with your producing more peas, for by our both being productive and trading with each other we are both better off. It is to your interest that I be successful in producing more corn, just as it is to my interest that you be successful in producing more peas.

Conflicts of interest do exist within a narrower scope of focus. For example, in the immediate present available resources are more fixed, and so competition for those resources results, and competition produces winners and losers. Economic competition, however, is a broader form of cooperation, a way socially to allocate resources without resorting to physical force and violence. By competition, resources are allocated efficiently and peacefully, and in the long run more resources are produced. Thus, a competitive economic system is in the self interest of all of us.

Accordingly, Rand argues that her ethic of self interest is the basis for personal happiness and free and prosperous societies.

3. Rand's Influence

The impact of Rand's ideas is difficult to measure, but it has been great. All of the books she published during her lifetime are still in print, have sold more than twenty million copies, and continue to sell hundreds of thousands of copies each year. A survey jointly conducted by the Library of Congress and the Book of the Month Club early in the 1990s asked readers to name the book that had most influenced their lives: Atlas Shrugged was second only to the Bible. Excerpts from Rand's works are regularly reprinted in college textbooks and anthologies, and several volumes have been published posthumously containing her early writings, journals, and letters. Those inspired by her ideas have published books in many academic fields and founded several institutes. Noteworthy among these are the Cato Institute, based in Washington, D.C., the leading libertarian think tank in the world. Rand, along with Nobel Prize-winners Friedrich Hayek and Milton Friedman, was highly instrumental in attracting generations of individuals to the libertarian movement. Also noteworthy are the Ayn Rand Institute, founded in 1985 by philosopher Leonard Peikoff and based in California, and The Objectivist Center, founded in 1990 by philosopher David Kelley and based in New York.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Binswanger, Harry. The Biological Basis of Teleological Concepts. Los Angeles, CA: A.R.I. Press, 1990.
    • Written by a philosopher, this is a scholarly work focused on the connection between biology and the concepts at the roots of ethics.
  • Branden, Nathaniel. The Psychology of Self-Esteem. Los Angeles: Nash Publishing, 1969.
  • Branden, Nathaniel, and Barbara Branden. Who Is Ayn Rand? New York: Random House, 1962.
    • This book contains three essays on Objectivism's moral philosophy, its connection to psychological theory, and a literary study of Rand's novel methods. It contains an additional biographical essay, tracing Rand's life from birth up until her mid-50s.
  • Hessen, Robert. In Defense of the Corporation. Stanford, CA: Hoover Institution, 1979.
    • An economic historian, Hessen argues and defends from an Objectivist perspective the moral and legal status of the corporate form of business organizations.
  • Kelley, David. The Evidence of the Senses. Baton Rouge: L.S.U. Press, 1986.
    • Written by a philosopher, this is a scholarly work in epistemology, focusing on the foundational role the senses play in human knowledge.
  • Mayhew, Robert. Ayn Rand's Marginalia. New Milford, CT: Second Renaissance Books, 1995.
    • This volume contains Rand's critical comments on over twenty thinkers, including Friedrich Hayek, C. S. Lewis, and Immanuel Kant. Edited by a philosopher, the volume contains facsimiles of the original texts with Rand's comments on facing pages.
  • Peikoff, Leonard. The Ominous Parallels: The End of Freedom in America. New York: Stein & Day, 1982.
    • A scholarly work in the philosophy of history, arguing Objectivism's theses about the role of philosophical ideas in history and applying them to explaining the rise of National Socialism.
  • Peikoff, Leonard. Objectivism: The Philosophy of Ayn Rand. New York: Dutton, 1991.
    • This is the first comprehensive overview of all aspects of Objectivist philosophy, written by the philosopher most close to Rand during her lifetime.
  • Rand, Ayn. Atlas Shrugged. Random House, 1957.
    • Rand's magnum opus of fiction.
  • Rand, Ayn.Capitalism: The Unknown Ideal. New American Library, 1967.
    • A collection of twenty of Rand's essays on politics, history, and economics. Also includes two essays by psychologist Nathaniel Branden, three by economist Alan Greenspan, and one by historian Robert Hessen.
  • Rand, Ayn. The Fountainhead. Bobbs-Merrill, 1943.
    • The novel of individualism, independence, and integrity that made Rand famous.
  • Rand, Ayn. Introduction to Objectivist Epistemology. New American Library, 1979.
    • Rand's theory of concept-formation. Also includes an essay by philosopher Leonard Peikoff on the analytic/synthetic distinction.
  • Rand, Ayn. Philosophy: Who Needs It. Bobbs-Merrill, 1982.
    • A collection of Rand's essays on the nature and significance of philosophy.
  • Rand, Ayn.The Romantic Manifesto. World Publishing, 1969. Paperback edition: New American Library, 1971.
    • A collection of Rand's essays on philosophy of art and aesthetics.
  • Rand, Ayn. The Virtue of Selfishness. New American Library, 1964.
    • A collection of fourteen of Rand's essays on ethics. Also includes five essays by psychologist Nathaniel Branden.
  • Rasmussen, Douglas and Douglas Den Uyl, editors. The Philosophic Thought of Ayn Rand. Urbana, IL: University of Illinois Press, 1984.
    • A collection of scholarly essays by philosophers, defending and criticizing various aspects of Objectivism's metaphysics, epistemology, ethics, and politics.
  • Reisman, George. Capitalism: A Treatise on Economics. Ottawa, IL: Jameson Books, 1996.
    • A scholarly work by an economist, developing capitalist economic theory and connecting it to Objectivist philosophy.
  • Sciabarra, Chris Matthew. Ayn Rand, The Russian Radical. University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1995.
    • A work in history of philosophy, this book attempts to trace the influence upon Rand's thinking of dialectical approaches to philosophy prevalent in 19th century Europe and Russia. Also an introduction and overview of the major branches of Objectivist philosophy.

Author Information

Stephen R. C. Hicks
Email: shicks@rockford.edu
Rockford College
U. S. A.

Paul Ricoeur (1913—2005)

RicoeurPaul Ricoeur was among the most impressive philosophers of the 20th century continental philosophers, both in the unusual breadth and depth of his philosophical scholarship and in the innovative nature of his thought. He was a prolific writer, and his work is essentially concerned with that grand theme of philosophy: the meaning of life. Ricoeur's "tensive" style focuses on the tensions running through the very structure of human being. His constant preoccupation was with a hermeneutic of the self, fundamental to which is the need we have for our lives to be made intelligible to us. Ricoeur's flagship in this endeavor is his narrative theory. Though a Christian philosopher whose work in theology is well-known and respected, his philosophical writings do not rely upon theological concepts, and are appreciated by non-Christians and Christians alike. His most widely read works are The Rule of Metaphor, From Text to Action, and Oneself As Another, and the three volumes of Time and Narrative. His other significant books include Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences, Conflict of Interpretations, The Symbolism of Evil, Freud and Philosophy, and Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Works
  2. Style
  3. Influences
  4. The Philosophy
  5. Time and Narrative
  6. Ethics
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected Ricoeur Bibliography
    2. Further Reading

1. Life and Works

Jean Paul Gustave Ricoeur was born on February 27, 1913, at Valence, France, and he died in Chatenay-Malabry, France on May 20, 2005. He lost both his parents within his first few years of his life and was raised with his sister Alice by his paternal grandparents, both of whom were devout Protestants. Ricoeur was a bookish child and successful student. He was awarded a scholarship to study at the Sorbonne in 1934, and afterwards was appointed to his first teaching position at Colmar, Alsace. While at the Sorbonne he first met Gabriel Marcel, who was to become a lifelong friend and philosophical influence. In 1935 he was married to Simone Lejas, with whom he has raised five children.

Ricoeur served in World War II – spending most of it as a prisoner of war – and was awarded the Croix de Guerre. He was interred with Mikel Dufrenne, with whom he later wrote a book on the work of Karl Jaspers. After the war Ricoeur returned to teaching, taking positions at the University of Strasbourg, the Sorbonne, University of Paris at Nanterre, the University of Louvain and University of Chicago. Ricoeur is a traditional philosopher in the sense that his work is highly systematic and steeped in the classics of Western philosophy. His is a reflective philosophy, that is, one that considers the most fundamental philosophical problems to concern self-understanding. While Ricoeur retains subjectivity at the heart of philosophy, his is no abstract Cartesian-style subject; the subject is always a situated subject, an embodied being anchored in a named and dated physical, historical and social world. For this reason his work is sometimes described as philosophical anthropology. Ricoeur is a post-structuralist hermeneutic philosopher who employs a model of textuality as the framework for his analysis of meaning, which extends across writing, speech, art and action. Ricoeur considers human understanding to be cogent only to the extent that it implicitly deploys structures and strategies characteristic of textuality. It is Ricoeur's view that our self-understandings, and indeed history itself , are "fictive", that is, subject to the productive effects of the imagination through interpretation. For Ricoeur, the human subjectivity is primarily linguistically designated and mediated by symbols. He states that the "problematic of existence" is given in language and must be worked out in language and discourse. Ricoeur refers to his hermeneutic method as a "hermeneutics of suspicion" because discourse both reveals and conceals something about the nature of being. Unlike post-structuralists such as Foucault and Derrida, for whom subjectivity is nothing more than an effect of language, Ricoeur anchors subjectivity in the human body and the material world, of which language is a kind of second order articulation. In the face of the fragmentation and alienation of post-modernity, Ricoeur offers his narrative theory as the path to a unified and meaningful life; indeed, to the good life.

2. Style

Ricoeur has developed a theoretical style that can best be described as "tensive". He weaves together heterogeneous concepts and discourses to form a composite discourse in which new meanings are created without diminishing the specificity and difference of the constitutive terms. Ricoeur's work on metaphor and on the human experience of time are perhaps the best examples of this method, although his entire philosophy is explicitly such a discourse. For example, in What Makes Us Think? Ricoeur discusses the nature of mental life in terms of the tension between our neurobiological conceptions of mind and our phenomenological concepts. Similarly, in the essay "Explanation and Understanding" he discusses human behavior in terms of the tension between concepts of material causation, and the language of actions and motives. The tensive style is in keeping with what Ricoeur regards as basic, ontological tensions inherent in the peculiar being that is human existence, namely, the ambiguity of belonging to both the natural world and the world of action (through freedom of the will). Accordingly, Ricoeur insists that philosophy find a way to contain and express those tensions, and so his work ranges across diverse schools of philosophical thought, bringing together insights and analysis from both the Anglo-American and European traditions, as well as from literary studies, political science and history.

The tensions are played out in our ability to take different perspectives on ourselves and so to formulate diverse approaches and methods in understanding ourselves. The different theoretical frameworks employed in philosophy and the sciences are not simply the result of ignorance or power. They are the result of tensions that run through the very structure of human being; tensions which Ricoeur describes as "fault lines." Ricoeur's entire body of work is an attempt to identify and map out the intersections of these numerous and irreducible lines that comprise our understandings of the human world. Ricoeur calls these "fault lines" because they are lines that can intersect in different ways in all the different aspects of human lives, giving lives different meanings. However, as points of intersection of discourses, these meanings can come apart. Ricoeur argues that the stability we enjoy with respect to the meanings of our lives is a tentative stability, subject to the influences of the material world, including the powers and afflictions of one's body, the actions of other people and institutions, and one's own emotional and cognitive states. Given the fundamental nature of these tensions, Ricoeur argues that it is ultimately poetics (exemplified in narrative), rather than philosophy that provides the structures and synthetic strategies by which understanding and a coherent sense of self and life is possible.

3. Influences

Ricoeur acknowledges his indebtedness to several key figures in the tradition, most notably, Aristotle, Kant, Hegel and Heidegger. Aristotelian teleology pervades Ricoeur's textual hermeneutics, and is most obvious in his adoption of a narrative approach. The concepts of "muthos" and "mimesis" in Aristotle's Poetics form the basis for Ricoeur's account of narrative "emplotment," which he enjoins with the innovative powers of the Kantian productive imagination within a general theory of poetics.

The influence of Hegel is manifest in Ricoeur's employment of a method he describes as a "refined dialectic." For Ricoeur, the dialectic is a "relative moment[s] in a complex process called interpretation" (Explanation and Understanding", 150). Like Hegel, the dialectic involves identifying key oppositional terms in a debate, and then proceeding to articulate their synthesis into a new, more developed concept. However, this synthesis does not have the uniformity of a Hegelian synthesis. Ricoeur's method entails showing how the meanings of two seemingly opposed terms are implicitly informed by, and borrow from, each other. Within the dialectic, the terms maintain their differences at the same time that a common "ground" is formed. However, the common ground is simply the ground of their mutual presupposition. Ricoeur's dialectic, then, is a unity of continuity and discontinuity. For example, in "Explanation and Understanding" Ricoeur argues that scientific explanation implicitly deploys a background hermeneutic understanding that exceeds the resources of explanation. At the same time, hermeneutic understanding necessarily relies upon the systematic process of explanation. Neither the natural sciences nor the human sciences are fully autonomous disciplines. A key dialectic that runs through Ricoeur's entire corpus is the dialectic of same and other. This is a foundational dialectic for him, and so, as might be expected, it structures his discussions and dissections of every field of philosophy he enters: selfhood, justice, love, morality, personal identity, knowledge, time, language, metaphor, action, aesthetics, metaphysics, and so on. Unlike the Hegelian dialectic, for Ricoeur, there is no absolute culminating point. There is, nevertheless, a kind of absolute, an objective existence that is revealed indirectly through the dialectic. This is most evident in the third volume of Time and Narrative, where he argues that phenomenological time presupposes an objective order of time (cosmological time), and in The Rule of Metaphor, where he argues that language belongs to, and is expressive of, extra-linguistic reality. Despite this apparent concession to realism, Ricoeur insists that the objective cannot be known as such, but merely grasped indirectly and analytically. Here, the Kantian influence comes to the fore. For Ricoeur, objective reality is the contemporary equivalent of Kantian noumena: although it can never itself become an object of knowledge, it is a kind of necessary thought, a limiting concept, implied in objects of knowledge. This view informs Ricoeur's "tensive" style. Although we can know, philosophically that there is an objective reality, and, in that sense, a metaphysical constraint on human existence, we can never understand human existence simply in terms of this objectivity. What we must appeal to in order to understand our existence are our substantive philosophical and ethical concepts and norms. This sets up an inevitable tension between the contingency of those norms and the brute fact of objective reality, evidenced in our experience of the involuntary, for example, as aging and dying. Again, Kant looms large. We necessarily regard ourselves from two perspectives: as the author of our actions in the practical world, and as part of, or passive to, cause and effect in the natural world. Such is the inherently ambiguous and tensive nature of human, mortal subjects. It is this condition, then, with which philosophy must grapple. And it is to this condition that Ricoeur offers narrative as the appropriate framework.

4. The Philosophy

There are two closely related questions that animate all of Ricoeur's work, and which he considers to be fundamental to philosophy: "Who am I?" and "How should I live?" The first question has been neglected by much of contemporary analytical and post-modern philosophy. Consequently, those philosophies lack the means to address the second question. Postmodernism self-consciously rejects traditional processes of identity formation, depicting them as familial and political power relations premised upon dubious metaphysical assumptions about gender, race and mind. At the same time, contemporary philosophy of mind reduces questions of "who?" to questions of "what?", and in doing so, closes down considerations of self while rendering the moral question one of mere instrumentality or utility. In relation to the question "Who am I?", Ricoeur acknowledges a long-standing debt to Marcel and Heidegger, and to a lesser extent to Merleau-Ponty. To the moral question, the debt is to Aristotle and Kant. In addressing the question "who am I?" Ricoeur sets out first to understand the nature of selfhood – to understand the being whose nature it is to enquire into itself.

In this endeavor, Ricoeur's philosophy is driven by the desire to provide an account that will do justice to the tensions and ambiguities which make us human, and which underpin our fallibility. Ricoeur's interest here can be noted as early as The Voluntary and The Involuntary, drafted during his years as a prisoner of war. There he explores the involuntary constraints to which we are necessarily subject in virtue of our being bodily mortal creatures, and the voluntariness necessary to the idea of ourselves as the agents of our actions. We have, as he later describes it, a "double allegiance", an allegiance to the material world of cause and effect, and to the phenomenal world of the freedom of the will by which we tear ourselves away from the laws of nature through action. This conception of the double nature of the self lies at the core of Ricoeur's philosophy. Ricoeur rejects the idea that a self is a metaphysical entity; there is no entity, "the self," there is only selfhood. Selfhood is an intersubjectively constituted capacity for agency and self-ascription that can be had by individual human beings. Selfhood proper is neither simply an abstract nor an animal self-awareness, but both. It essentially involves an active grasp of oneself as a "who"--that is, as a person who is the subject of a concrete situation, a situation characterized by material and phenomenal qualities. This entails understanding oneself as a named person with a time and place of birth, linked to other similarly named persons and to certain ethnic and cultural traditions, living in a dated and named place. In Oneself As Another Ricoeur describes how the complexity of the question of "who?" opens directly onto a certain way of articulating the question of personal identity: "how the self can be at one and the same time a person of whom we speak and a subject who designates herself in the first person while addressing a second person. . . The difficulty will be . . . understanding how the third person is designated in discourse as someone who designates himself as a first person (34-5)". Drawing on Heidegger's notion of Dasein, Ricoeur goes on to write that "To say self is not to say myself . . . the passage from selfhood to mineness is marked by the clause "in each case" . . . The self . . . is in each case mine" (OAA 180). What he means by this is that each person has to take one's selfhood as one's own; each must take oneself as who one is; one must "attest" to oneself. Subjectivity, or selfhood, is for Ricoeur, a dialectic of activity and passivity because we are beings with a "double nature," structured along the fault lines of the voluntary and the involuntary, beings given to ourselves as something to be known. Ricoeur shares Marcel's view that the answer to the question "Who am I?" can never be fully explicated. This is because, in asking "Who am I?", "I" who pose the question necessarily fall within the domain of enquiry; I am both seeker and what is sought. This peculiar circularity gives a "questing" and dialectical character to selfhood, which now requires a hermeneutic approach. This circularity has its origins in the nature of embodied subjectivity. Ricoeur's account is built upon Marcel's conception of embodied subjectivity as a "fundamental predicament"(Marcel, 1965). The predicament lies in the anti-dualist realization that "I" and my body are not metaphysically distinct entities. My body cannot be abstracted from its being mine. Whatever states I may attribute to my body as its states, I do so only insofar as they are attributes of mine. My body is both something that I am and something that I have: it is "my body" that imagines, perceives and experiences. The unity of "my body" is a unity sui generis. Yet my body is also that over which I exercise a certain instrumentality through my agency. However, the agency that effects that instrumentality is nothing other than "my body." There is no I-body relation; the primitive term here is "my body." The inherent ambiguity of the "carnate body" or "corps-sujet" can be directly experienced by clasping one's own hands (an example often employed by Marcel and Merleau-Ponty). In this experience the distinction between subject and object becomes blurred: it isn't clear which hand is being touched and which is touching; each hand oscillates between the role of agent and object, without ever being both simultaneously. One cannot feel oneself feeling. This example is supposed to demonstrate two points: first, that the ambiguity of my body prevents the complete objectification of myself, and second, that ambiguity extends to all perception. Perception is not simply passive, but rather, involves an active reception (a concept that Ricoeur takes up and develops in his account of the ontology of the self and one's own body in Oneself As Another, see 319–329). In other words, my body has an active role in structuring my perceptions, and so, the meaning of my perceptions needs to be interpreted in the context of my bodily situation. The non-coincidence of myself and my body constitutes a "fault line" within the structure of subjectivity. The result is that knowledge of myself and the world is not constituted by more or less accurate facts, but rather, is a composite discourse--a discourse which charts the intersection of the objective, intersubjective and subjective aspects of lived experience. On this view, all knowledge, including my knowledge of my own existence, is mediate and so calls for interpretation. This also means that self-understanding can never be grasped by the kind of introspective immediacy celebrated by Descartes. Instead, as human beings we are never quite "at one" with ourselves; we are fallible creatures. Thus, who I am is not an objective fact to be discovered, but rather something that I must achieve or create, and to which I must attest. On Ricoeur's view, the question "Who am I ?" is a question specific to a certain kind of being, namely, being a subject of a temporal, material, linguistic and social unity. The ability to grasp oneself as a concrete subject of such a world requires a complex mode of understanding capable of integrating discourses of quite heterogenous kinds, including, importantly, different orders of time. It is to the temporal dimension of selfhood that Ricoeur has most directly addressed his hermeneutic philosophy and narrative model of understanding.

5. Time and Narrative

Central to Ricoeur's defense of narrative is its capacity to represent the human experience of time. Such a capacity is an essential requisite for a reflective philosophy. Ricoeur sets out his account of "human time" in Time and Narrative, Volume 3. He points out that we experience time in two different ways. We experience time as linear succession, we experience the passing hours and days and the progression of our lives from birth to death. This is cosmological time--time expressed in the metaphor of the "river" of time. The other is phenomenological time; time experienced in terms of the past, present and future. As self-aware embodied beings, we not only experience time as linear succession, but we are also oriented to the succession of time in terms of what has been, what is, and what will be. Ricoeur's concept of "human time" is expressive of a complex experience in which phenomenological time and cosmological time are integrated. For example, we understand the full meaning of "yesterday" or "today" by reference to their order in a succession of dated time. To say "Today is my birthday" is to immediately invoke both orders of time: a chronological date to which is anchored the phenomenological concept of "birthday." Ricoeur describes this anchoring as the "inscription" of phenomenological time on cosmological time (TN3 109).

These two conceptions of time have traditionally been seen in opposition, but Ricoeur argues that they share a relation of mutual presupposition. The order of "past-present-future" within phenomenological time presupposes the succession characteristic of cosmological time. The past is always before the present which is always after the past and before the future. The order of succession is invariable, and this order is not part of the concepts of past, present or future considered merely as existential orientations. On the other hand, within cosmological time, the identification of supposedly anonymous instants of time as "before" or "after" within the succession borrows from the phenomenological orientation to past and future. Ricoeur argues that any philosophical model for understanding human existence must employ a composite temporal framework. The only suitable candidate here is the narrative model. Ricoeur links narrative's temporal complexity to Aristotle's characterization of narrative as "the imitation of an action". Ricoeur's account of the way in which narrative represents the human world of acting (and, in its passive mode, suffering) turns on three stages of interpretation that he calls mimesis1 (prefiguration of the field of action), mimesis2 (configuration of the field of action), and mimesis3 (refiguration of the field of action). Mimesis1 describes the way in which the field of human acting is always already prefigured with certain basic competencies, for example, competency in the conceptual network of the semantics of action (expressed in the ability to raise questions of who, how, why, with whom, against whom, etc.); in the use of symbols (being able to grasp one thing as standing for something else); and competency in the temporal structures governing the syntagmatic order of narration (the "followability" of a narrative). Mimesis2 concerns the imaginative configuration of the elements given in the field of action at the level of mimesis1. Mimesis2 concerns narrative "emplotment." Ricoeur describes this level as "the kingdom of the as if" Narrative emplotment brings the diverse elements of a situation into an imaginative order, in just the same way as does the plot of a story. Emplotment here has a mediating function. It configures events, agents and objects and renders those individual elements meaningful as part of a larger whole in which each takes a place in the network that constitutes the narrative's response to why, how, who, where, when, etc. By bringing together heterogeneous factors into its syntactical order emplotment creates a "concordant discordance," a tensive unity which functions as a redescription of a situation in which the internal coherence of the constitutive elements endows them with an explanatory role. A particularly useful feature of narrative which becomes apparent at the level mimesis2 is the way in which the linear chronology of emplotment is able to represent different experiences of time. What is depicted as the "past" and the "present" within the plot does not necessarily correspond to the "before" and "after" of its linear, episodic structure. For example, a narrative may begin with a culminating event, or it may devote long passages to events depicted as occurring within relatively short periods of time. Dates and times can be disconnected from their denotative function; grammatical tenses can be changed, and changes in the tempo and duration of scenes create a temporality that is "lived" in the story that does not coincide with either the time of the world in which the story is read, nor the time that the unfolding events are said to depict. In Volume 2 of Time and Narrative, Ricoeur's analyses of Mrs. Dalloway, The Magic Mountain and Remembrance of Things Past centre on the diverse variations of time produced by the interplay of a three tiered structure of time: the time of narrating; the narrated time; and the fictive experience of time produced through "the conjunction/disjunction of the time it takes to narrate and narrated time" (TN2 77). Narrative configuration has at hand a rich array of strategies for temporal signification. Another key feature of mimesis2 is the ability of the internal logic of the narrative unity (created by emplotment) to endow the connections between the elements of the narrative with necessity. In this way, emplotment forges a causal continuity from a temporal succession, and so creates the intelligibility and credibility of the narrative. Ricoeur argues that the temporal order of the events depicted in the narrative is simultaneous with the construction of the necessity that connects those elements into a conceptual unity: from the structure of one thing after another arises the conceptual relation of one thing because of another. It is this conversion that so well "imitates" the continuity demanded by a life, and makes it the ideal model for personal identity and self-understanding. Mimesis3 concerns the integration of the imaginative or "fictive" perspective offered at the level of mimesis2 into actual, lived experience. Ricoeur's model for this is a phenomenology of reading, which he describes as "the intersection of the world of the text and the world of the reader"(TN1 71). Not only are our life stories "written," they must be "read," and when they are read they are taken as one's own and integrated into one's identity and self-understanding. Mimesis3 effects the integration of the hypothetical to the real by anchoring the time depicted (or recollected or imputed) in a dated "now" and "then" of actual, lived time. Mimesis is a cyclical interpretative process because it is inserted into the passage of cosmological time. As time passes, our circumstances give rise to new experiences and new opportunities for reflection. We can redescribe our past experiences, bringing to light unrealized connections between agents, actors, circumstances, motives or objects, by drawing connections between the events retold and events that have occurred since, or by bringing to light untold details of past events. Of course, narrative need not have a happy ending. The concern of narrative is coherence and structure, not the creation of a particular kind of experience. Nevertheless, the possibility of redescription of the past offers us the possibility of re-imagining and reconstructing a future inspired by hope. It is this potentially inexhaustible process that is the fuel for philosophy and literature.

6. Ethics

Besides the metaphysical complexity and heterogeneity of the human situation, one of Ricoeur's deepest concerns is the tentative, even fragile status of the coherence of a life. His conception of ethics is directly tied to his conception of the narrative self. Because selfhood is something that must be achieved and something dependent upon the regard, words and actions of others, as well as chancy material conditions, one can fail to achieve selfhood, or one's sense of who one is can fall apart. The narrative coherence of one's life can be lost, and with that loss comes the inability to regard oneself as the worthy subject of a good life; in other words, the loss of self-esteem.

Ricoeur's ethics is teleological. He argues that human life has an ethical aim, and that aim is self-esteem: "the interpretation of ourselves mediated by the ethical evaluation of our actions. Self-esteem is itself an evaluation process indirectly applied to ourselves as selves" (The Narrative Path, 99). In short, self-esteem means being able to attest to oneself as being the worthy subject of a good life, where "good" is an evaluation informed not simply by one's own subjective criteria, but rather by intersubjective criteria to which one attests. This entails another moral concept: that of imputation. As the subject of my actions, I am responsible for what I do; I am the subject to whom my actions can be imputed and whose character is to be interpreted in the light of those actions. Ricoeur describes the ethical perspective that arises from this view of the subject as "aiming at the good life" with and for others, in just institutions" (OAA 172). Such a perspective merely spells out the premise of this practical and material conception of selfhood, with its presupposition of the world of action, lived with others. For Ricoeur, a life can have an aim because the teleological structure of action extends over a whole life, understood within the narrative framework. The ethical life is achieved by aiming to live well with others in just institutions. Ricoeur's view of selfhood has it that we are utterly reliant upon each other. While Ricoeur emphasizes the importance of the first person perspective and the notion of personal responsibility, his is no philosophy of the radical individual. He emphasizes that we are "mutually vulnerable", and so the fate (self-esteem) of each of us is tied up with the fate of others. This situation has a normative dimension: we have an indebtedness to each other, a duty to care for each other and to engender self-respect and justice, all of which are necessary to the creation and preservation of self-esteem. While duty runs deep, Ricoeur argues that it is nevertheless preceded by a certain reciprocity. In order to feel commanded by duty, one must first have the capacity to hear and respond to the demand of the Other. That is, there must be some fundamental, primordial openness and orientation to others for the power of duty to be felt. Prior to duty there must be a basic reciprocity, which underlies our mutual vulnerability and from which duty, as well as the possibility of friendship and justice, arises. Here, Ricoeur emphasizes the ethical primacy of acting and suffering. Ricoeur calls this phenomenon "solicitude" or "benevolent spontaneity" (OAA 190). It makes the relation of self and Other (and thus, ethics) primordial, or ontological – hence the title of Ricoeur's book on ethics, Oneself As Another. Self-esteem is said to arise from a primitive reciprocity of spontaneous, benevolent feelings, feelings which one is also capable of directing toward oneself, but only through the benevolence of others. This fundamental reciprocity is prior to the activity of giving. This can be demonstrated in the situation of sympathy, where it is the Other's suffering (not acting) that one shares. Here, Ricoeur argues that "from the suffering Other there comes a giving that is no longer drawn from the power of acting and existing, but precisely from weakness itself" (OAA 188-9). In this case, the suffering Other is unable to act, and yet gives. What the suffering Other gives to he or she who shares this suffering is precisely the knowledge of their shared vulnerability and the experience of the spontaneous benevolence required to bear that knowledge. As might be supposed from Ricoeur's view of embodied subjectivity, one is always already an Other to oneself. So, love and understanding for others, and love and understanding for oneself, are two sides of the same sheet of paper, so to speak. One becomes who one is through relations with the Other, whether in the instance of one's own body or another's. Reciprocity forms the basis of those productive and self-affirming relations central to so much of ethics, namely friendship and justice. Its corruption leads to self-loathing and the destruction of self-esteem, which goes hand-in-hand with harm to others and injustice. For Ricoeur, friendship and justice become the chief virtues because of their crucial role in the well-being of selfhood, and thus, in maintaining the conditions of possibility of selfhood. Friends and just institutions not only protect against the suffering of self-destruction to which one is always vulnerable, they provide the means for reconstructing and redeeming damaged lives. The theme of redemption runs right through Ricoeur's work, and no doubt it has a religious origin. However, the notion of redemption can be viewed in secular terms as the counterpart to the constructive nature of one's identity, and the temporal complexity of the human situation which calls for interpretation.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Marcel, Gabriel. Being and Having: an existentialist diary (New York: Harper and Row, 1965).
  • Marcel, Gabriel. The Mystery of Being: 1, Reflection and Mystery (Chicago: Henry Regnery, 1960).
  • Merleau-Ponty, Maurice.  The Visible and The Invisible, trans. Alphonso Lingis (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1968).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. "Explanation and Understanding" in From Text to Action, trans. Kathleen Blamey and John Thompson (Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1991).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. "Humans as the Subject Matter of Philosophy" in The Narrative Path, The Later Works of Paul Ricoeur, eds. T. Peter Kemp and David Rasmussen (Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press, 1988).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. "Intellectual Autobiography" in Lewis Edwin Hahn, ed., The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur, The Library of Living Philosophers Volume XXII (Chicago, Illinois: Open Court, 1995).
  • Ricoeur, Paul. "What is Dialectical?" in Freedom and Morality ed. John Bricke, (Lawrence: University of Kansas, 1976).

a. Selected Ricoeur Bibliography

  • History and Truth, trans. Charles A Kelbley, (Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 1965)
  • Fallible Man, trans. Charles A Kelbley (New York: Fordham University Press, 1986)
  • Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary (Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 1966)
  • Husserl: An Analysis of his Phenomenology, trans. E. G. Ballard and L. E. Embree (Evanston, Illinois: Northwestern University Press, 1966)
  • The Symbolism of Evil, trans. E. Buchanan (New York and Evanston: Harper-Row, 1967)
  • Freud and Philosophy: an essay on interpretation, trans. D. Savage (New Haven and London: Yale University Press, 1970)
  • Tragic Wisdom and Beyond, with Gabriel Marcel, trans. P. McCormick and S. Jolin (Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1973)
  • The Conflict of Interpretations. Essays in Hermeneutics, trans. D. Ihde (Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1974)
  • The Rule of Metaphor, multidisciplinary studies in the creation of meaning in language (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1978)
  • Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences. Essays on Language, Action and Interpretation edited and trans. J. B. Thompson (Cambridge and New York: Cambridge University Press, 1981)
  • Time and Narrative, Volumes 1-3, trans. Kathleen Blamey and David Pellauer (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1984 -1988)
  • From Text to Action, trans. Kathleen Blamey and John Thompson (Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1991)
  • Oneself as Another, trans. Kathleen Blamey (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992)
  • Tolerance between intolerance and the intolerable (Providence: Berghahn Books, 1996)
  • Critique and conviction : conversations with FranÁois Azouvi and Marc de Launay trans. Kathleen Blamey (New York: Columbia University Press, 1998)
  • Thinking Biblically: Exegetical and Hermeneutical Studies, with Andre LeCocque (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 1998)
  • The Just, trans. David Pellauer (Chicago and London: University of Chicago Press, 2000)
  • What Makes Us Think? A Neuroscientist and a Philosopher Argue About Ethics, Human Nature and the Brain, with Jean-Pierre Changeux, trans. M. B. DeBevoise (Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press, 2000)

b. Further Reading

  • Henry Isaac Venema: Identifying selfhood : imagination, narrative, and hermeneutics in the thought of Paul Ricoeur (Albany, N.Y. : State University of New York Press, 2000)
  • Bernard P. Dauenhauer : Paul Ricoeur : the promise and risk of politics (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 1998)
  • Charles E. Regan, Paul Ricoeur, his life and his work (Chicago & London: University of Chicago Press, 1996)
  • Lewis Edwin Hahn, ed. The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur, The Library of Living Philosophers Volume XXII (Chicago, Illinois: Open Court, 1995)
  • David Wood, ed. On Paul Ricoeur (London & New York: Routledge, 1991)
  • S.H. Clark: Paul Ricoeur (London and New York: Routledge, 1990)
  • Patrick L. Bourgeois and Frank Schalow: Traces of understanding: a profile of Heidegger's and Ricoeur's hermeneutics (Amsterdam and Atlanta, GA : Rodopi, 1990)
  • T. Peter Kemp and David Rasmussen: The Narrative Path: The Later Works of Paul Ricoeur (Cambridge, Mass: MIT Press, 1989)
  • John B. Thompson: Critical hermeneutics : a study in the thought of Paul Ricoeur and Jurgen Habermas (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981)
  • Charles E. Reagan ed: Studies in the Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur (Athens: Ohio University Press, 1979)
  • Don Ihde, Hermeneutic Phenomenology: The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur (Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1971)

Author Information

Kim Atkins
Email: kim.atkins@utas.edu.au
University of Tasmania
Tasmania

Heraclitus (fl. c. 500 B.C.E.)

HeraclitusA Greek philosopher of the late 6th century BCE, Heraclitus criticizes his predecessors and contemporaries for their failure to see the unity in experience. He claims to announce an everlasting Word (Logos) according to which all things are one, in some sense. Opposites are necessary for life, but they are unified in a system of balanced exchanges. The world itself consists of a law-like interchange of elements, symbolized by fire. Thus the world is not to be identified with any particular substance, but rather with an ongoing process governed by a law of change. The underlying law of nature also manifests itself as a moral law for human beings. Heraclitus is the first Western philosopher to go beyond physical theory in search of metaphysical foundations and moral applications.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Times
  2. Theory of Knowledge
  3. The Doctrine of Flux and the Unity of Opposites
  4. Criticism of Ionian Philosophy
  5. Physical Theory
  6. Moral and Political Theory
  7. Accomplishments and Influence
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Times

Heraclitus lived in Ephesus, an important city on the Ionian coast of Asia Minor, not far from Miletus, the birthplace of philosophy. We know nothing about his life other than what can be gleaned from his own statements, for all ancient biographies of him consist of nothing more than inferences or imaginary constructions based on his sayings. Although Plato thought he wrote after Parmenides, it is more likely he wrote before Parmenides. For he criticizes by name important thinkers and writers with whom he disagrees, and he does not mention Parmenides. On the other hand, Parmenides in his poem arguably echoes the words of Heraclitus.  Heraclitus criticizes the mythographers Homer and Hesiod, as well as the philosophers Pythagoras and Xenophanes and the historian Hecataeus. All of these figures flourished in the 6th century BCE or earlier, suggesting a date for Heraclitus in the late 6th century. Although he does not speak in detail of his political views in the extant fragments, Heraclitus seems to reflect an aristocratic disdain for the masses and favor the rule of a few wise men, for instance when he recommends that his fellow-citizens hang themselves because they have banished their most prominent leader (DK22B121 in the Diels-Kranz collection of Presocratic sources).

2. Theory of Knowledge

Heraclitus sees the great majority of human beings as lacking understanding:

Of this Word's being forever do men prove to be uncomprehending, both before they hear and once they have heard it. For although all things happen according to this Word they are like the unexperienced experiencing words and deeds such as I explain when I distinguish each thing according to its nature and declare how it is. Other men are unaware of what they do when they are awake just as they are forgetful of what they do when they are asleep. (DK22B1)

Most people sleep-walk through life, not understanding what is going on about them. Yet experience of words and deeds can enlighten those who are receptive to their meaning. (The opening sentence is ambiguous: does the 'forever' go with the preceding or the following words? Heraclitus prefigures the semantic complexity of his message.)

On the one hand, Heraclitus commends sense experience: "The things of which there is sight, hearing, experience, I prefer" (DK22B55). On the other hand, "Poor witnesses for men are their eyes and ears if they have barbarian souls" (DK22B107). A barbarian is one who does not speak the Greek language. Thus while sense experience seems necessary for understanding, if we do not know the right language, we cannot interpret the information the senses provide. Heraclitus does not give a detailed and systematic account of the respective roles of experience and reason in knowledge. But we can learn something from his manner of expression.

Describing the practice of religious prophets, Heraclitus says, "The Lord whose oracle is at Delphi neither reveals nor conceals, but gives a sign" (DK22B93). Similarly, Heraclitus does not reveal or conceal, but produces complex expressions that have encoded in them multiple messages for those who can interpret them. He uses puns, paradoxes, antitheses, parallels, and various rhetorical and literary devices to construct expressions that have meanings beyond the obvious. This practice, together with his emphasis on the Word (Logos) as an ordering principle of the world, suggests that he sees his own expressions as imitations of the world with its structural and semantic complexity. To read Heraclitus the reader must solve verbal puzzles, and to learn to solve these puzzles is to learn to read the signs of the world. Heraclitus stresses the inductive rather than the deductive method of grasping the world, a world that is rationally structured, if we can but discern its shape.

For those who can discern it, the Word has an overriding message to impart: "Listening not to me but to the Word it is wise to agree that all things are one" (DK22B50). It is perhaps Heraclitus's chief project to explain in what sense all things are one.

3. The Doctrine of Flux and the Unity of Opposites

According to both Plato and Aristotle, Heraclitus held extreme views that led to logical incoherence. For he held that (1) everything is constantly changing and (2) opposite things are identical, so that (3) everything is and is not at the same time. In other words, Universal Flux and the Identity of Opposites entail a denial of the Law of Non-Contradiction. Plato indicates the source of the flux doctrine: "Heraclitus, I believe, says that all things go and nothing stays, and comparing existents to the flow of a river, he says you could not step twice into the same river" (Cratylus 402a = DK22A6).

What Heraclitus actually says is the following:

On those stepping into rivers staying the same other and other waters flow. (DK22B12)

There is an antithesis between 'same' and 'other.' The sentence says that different waters flow in rivers staying the same. In other words, though the waters are always changing, the rivers stay the same. Indeed, it must be precisely because the waters are always changing that there are rivers at all, rather than lakes or ponds. The message is that rivers can stay the same over time even though, or indeed because, the waters change. The point, then, is not that everything is changing, but that the fact that some things change makes possible the continued existence of other things. Perhaps more generally, the change in elements or constituents supports the constancy of higher-level structures.As for the alleged doctrine of the Identity of Opposites, Heraclitus does believe in some kind of unity of opposites. For instance, "God is day night, winter summer, war peace, satiety hunger . . ." (DK22B67). But if we look closer, we see that the unity in question is not identity:

As the same thing in us is living and dead, waking and sleeping, young and old. For these things having changed around are those, and conversely those having changed around are these. (DK22B88)

The second sentence in B88 gives the explanation for the first. If F is the same as G because F turns into G, then the two are not identical. And Heraclitus insists on the common-sense truth of change: "Cold things warm up, the hot cools off, wet becomes dry, dry becomes wet" (DK22B126). This sort of mutual change presupposes the non-identity of the terms. What Heraclitus wishes to maintain is not the identity of opposites but the fact that they replace each other in a series of transformations: they are interchangeable or transformationally equivalent.

Thus, Heraclitus does not hold Universal Flux, but recognizes a lawlike flux of elements; and he does not hold the Identity of Opposites, but the Transformational Equivalence of Opposites. The views that he does hold do not, jointly or separately, entail a denial of the Law of Non-Contradiction. Heraclitus does, to be sure, make paradoxical statements, but his views are no more self-contradictory than are the paradoxical claims of Socrates. They are, presumably, meant to wake us up from our dogmatic slumbers.

4. Criticism of Ionian Philosophy

Heraclitus' theory can be understood as a response to the philosophy of his Ionian predecessors. The philosophers of the city of Miletus (near Ephesus), Thales, Anaximander, and Anaximenes, believed some original material turns into all other things. The world as we know it is the orderly articulation of different stuffs produced out of the original stuff. For the Milesians, to explain the world and its phenomena was just to show how everything came from the original stuff, such as Thales' water or Anaximenes' air.

Heraclitus seems to follow this pattern of explanation when he refers to the world as "everliving fire" (DK22B30, quoted in full in next section) and makes statements such as "Thunderbolt steers all things," alluding to the directive power of fire (DK22B64). But fire is a strange stuff to make the origin of all things, for it is the most inconstant and changeable. It is, indeed, a symbol of change and process. Heraclitus observes,

All things are an exchange for fire, and fire for all things, as goods for gold and gold for goods. (DK22B90)

We can measure all things against fire as a standard; there is an equivalence between all things and gold, but all things are not identical to gold. Similarly, fire provides a standard of value for other stuffs, but it is not identical to them. Fire plays an important role in Heraclitus' system, but it is not the unique source of all things, because all stuffs are equivalent.

Ultimately, fire may be more important as a symbol than as a stuff. Fire is constantly changing-but so is every other stuff. One thing is transformed into another in a cycle of changes. What is constant is not some stuff, but the overall process of change itself. There is a constant law of transformations, which is, perhaps, to be identified with the Logos. Heraclitus may be saying that the Milesians correctly saw that one stuff turns into another in a series, but they incorrectly inferred from this that some one stuff is the source of everything else. But if A is the source of B and B of C, and C turns back into B and then A, then B is likewise the source of A and C, and C is the source of A and B. There is no particular reason to promote one stuff at the expense of the others. What is important about the stuffs is that they change into others. The one constant in the whole process is the law of change by which there is an order and sequence to the changes. If this is what Heraclitus has in mind, he goes beyond the physical theory of his early predecessors to arrive at something like a process philosophy with a sophisticated understanding of metaphysics.

5. Physical Theory

Heraclitus' criticisms and metaphysical speculations are grounded in a physical theory. He expresses the principles of his cosmology in a single sentence:

This world-order, the same of all, no god nor man did create, but it ever was and is and will be: everliving fire, kindling in measures and being quenched in measures. (DK22B30)
This passage contains the earliest extant philosophical use of the word kosmos, "world-order," denoting the organized world in which we live, with earth, sea, atmosphere, and heavens. While ancient sources understand Heraclitus as saying the world comes to be and then perishes in a fiery holocaust, only to be born again (DK22A10), the present passage seems to contradict this reading: the world itself does not have a beginning or end. Parts of it are being consumed by fire at any given time, but the whole remains. Almost all other early cosmologists before and after Heraclitus explained the existence of the ordered world by recounting its origin out of elemental stuffs. Some also predicted the extinction of the world. But Heraclitus, the philosopher of flux, believes that as the stuffs turn into one another, the world itself remains stable. How can that be?

Heraclitus explains the order and proportion in which the stuffs change:

The turnings of fire: first sea, and of sea, half is earth, half firewind (prêstêr: some sort of fiery meteorological phenomenon). (DK22B31a)

Sea is liquefied and measured into the same proportion as it had before it became earth. (DK22B31b)

Fire is transformed into water ("sea") of which half turns back into fire ("firewind") and half into earth. Thus there is a sequence of stuffs: fire, water, earth, which are interconnected. When earth turns back into sea, it occupies the same volume as it had before it turned into earth. Thus we can recognize a primitive law of conservation-not precisely conservation of matter, at least the identity of the matter is not conserved, nor of mass, but at least an equivalence of matter is maintained. Although the fragments do not give detailed information about Heraclitus' physics, it seems likely that the amount of water that evaporates each day is balanced by the amount of stuff that precipitates as water, and so on, so that a balance of stuffs is maintained even though portions of stuff are constantly changing their identity.

For Heraclitus, flux and opposition are necessary for life. Aristotle reports,

Heraclitus criticizes the poet who said, 'would that strife might perish from among gods and men' [Homer Iliad 18.107]' for there would not be harmony without high and low notes, nor living things without female and male, which are opposites. (DK22A22)

Heraclitus views strife or conflict as maintaining the world:

We must recognize that war is common and strife is justice, and all things happen according to strife and necessity. (DK22B80)

War is the father of all and king of all, who manifested some as gods and some as men, who made some slaves and some freemen. (DK22B53)

In a tacit criticism of Anaximander, Heraclitus rejects the view that cosmic justice is designed to punish one opposite for its transgressions against another. If it were not for the constant conflict of opposites, there would be no alternations of day and night, hot and cold, summer and winter, even life and death. Indeed, if some things did not die, others would not be born. Conflict does not interfere with life, but rather is a precondition of life.

As we have seen, for Heraclitus fire changes into water and then into earth; earth changes into water and then into fire. At the level of either cosmic bodies (in which sea turns into fiery storms on the one hand and earth on the other) or domestic activities (in which, for instance, water boils out of a pot), there is constant flux among opposites. To maintain the balance of the world, we must posit an equal and opposite reaction to every change. Heraclitus observes,

The road up and down is one and the same. (DK22B60)

Here again we find a unity of opposites, but no contradiction. One road is used to pursue two different routes. Daily traffic carries some travelers out of the city, while it brings some back in. The image applies equally to physical theory: as earth changes to fire, fire changes to earth. And it may apply to psychology and other domains as well.

6. Moral and Political Theory

There has been some debate as to whether Heraclitus is chiefly a philosopher of nature (a view championed by G. S. Kirk) or a philosopher concerned with the human condition (C. H. Kahn). The opening words of Heraclitus' book (DK22B1, quoted above) seem to indicate that he will expound the nature of things in a way that will have profound implications for human life. In other words, he seems to see the theory of nature and the human condition as intimately connected. In fact, recently discovered papyri have shown that Heraclitus is concerned with technical questions of astronomy, not only with general theory. There is no reason, then, to think of him as solely a humanist or moral philosopher. On the other hand, it would be wrong to think of him as a straightforward natural philosopher in the manner of other Ionian philosophers, for he is deeply concerned with the moral implications of physical theory.

Heraclitus views the soul as fiery in nature:

To souls it is death to become water, to water death to become earth, but from earth water is born, and from water soul. (DK22B36)

Soul is generated out of other substances just as fire is. But it has a limitless dimension:

If you went in search of it, you would not find the boundaries of the soul, though you traveled every road-so deep is its measure [logos]. (DK22B45)

Drunkenness damages the soul by causing it to be moist, while a virtuous life keeps the soul dry and intelligent. Souls seem to be able to survive death and to fare according to their character.

The laws of a city-state are an important principle of order:

The people [of a city] should fight for their laws as they would for their city wall. (DK22B44)

Speaking with sense we must rely on a common sense of all things, as a city relies on its wall, and much more reliably. For all human laws are nourished by the one divine law. For it prevails as far as it will and suffices for all and overflows. (DK22B114)

The laws provide a defense for a city and its way of life. But the laws are not merely of local interest: they derive their force from a divine law. Here we see the notion of a law of nature that informs human society as well as nature. There is a human cosmos that like the natural cosmos reflects an underlying order. The laws by which human societies are governed are not mere conventions, but are grounded in the ultimate nature of things. One cannot break a human law with impunity. The notion of a law-like order in nature has antecedents in the theory of Anaximander, and the notion of an inherent moral law influences the Stoics in the 3rd century BCE.

Heraclitus recognizes a divine unity behind the cosmos, one that is difficult to identify and perhaps impossible to separate from the processes of the cosmos:

The wise, being one thing only, would and would not take the name of Zeus [or: Life]. (DK22B32)

God is day night, winter summer, war peace, satiety hunger, and it alters just as when it is mixed with incense is named according to the aroma of each. (DK22B67)

Evidently the world either is god, or is a manifestation of the activity of god, which is somehow to be identified with the underlying order of things. God can be thought of as fire, but fire, as we have seen, is constantly changing, symbolic of transformation and process. Divinity is present in the world, but not as a conventional anthropomorphic being such as the Greeks worshiped.

7. Accomplishments and Influence

Heraclitus goes beyond the natural philosophy of the other Ionian philosophers to make profound criticisms and develop far-reaching implications of those criticisms. He suggests the first metaphysical foundation for philosophical speculation, anticipating process philosophy. And he makes human values a central concern of philosophy for the first time. His aphoristic manner of expression and his manner of propounding general truths through concrete examples remained unique.

Heraclitus's paradoxical exposition may have spurred Parmenides' rejection of Ionian philosophy. Empedocles and some medical writers echoed Heraclitean themes of alteration and ongoing process, while Democritus imitated his ethical observations. Influenced by the teachings of the Heraclitean Cratylus, Plato saw the sensible world as exemplifying a Heraclitean flux. Plato and Aristotle both criticized Heraclitus for a radical theory that led to a denial of the Law of Non-Contradiction. The Stoics adopted Heraclitus's physical principles as the basis for their theories.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1982, vol. 1, ch. 4.
    • Uses modern arguments to defend the traditional view, going back to Plato and Aristotle, that Heraclitus' commitment to the flux doctrine and the identity of opposites results in an incoherent theory.
  • Graham, Daniel W. "Heraclitus' Criticism of Ionian Philosophy." Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 15 (1997): 1-50.
    • Defends Heraclitus against the traditional view held by Barnes and others, and argues that his theory can be understood as a coherent criticism of earlier Ionian philosophy.
  • Hussey, Edward. "Epistemology and Meaning in Heraclitus." Language and Logos. Ed. M. Schofield and M. C. Nussbaum. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1982. 33-59.
    • Studies Heraclitus' theory of knowledge.
  • Kahn, Charles H. The Art and Thought of Heraclitus. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1979.
    • An important reassessment of Heraclitus that recognizes the literary complexity of his language as a key to interpreting his message. Focuses on Heraclitus as a philosopher of the human condition.
  • Kirk, G. S. Heraclitus: The Cosmic Fragments. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1954.
    • Focuses on Heraclitus as a natural philosopher.
  • Marcovich, Miroslav. Heraclitus: Greek Text with a Short Commentary. Merida, Venezuela: U. of the Andes, 1967.
    • A very thorough edition of Heraclitus, which effectively sorts out fragments from reports and reactions.
  • Mourelatos, Alexander P. D. "Heraclitus, Parmenides, and the Naive Metaphysics of Things." Exegesis and Argument. Ed. E. N. Lee et al. Assen: Van Gorcum, 1973. 16-48.
    • Examines Heraclitus' response to the pre-philosophical understanding of things.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. "Psychê in Heraclitus." Phronesis 17 (1972): 1-16, 153-70.
    • Good treatment of Heraclitus' conception of soul.
  • Robinson, T. M. Heraclitus: Fragments. Toronto: U of Toronto P, 1987.
    • Good brief edition with commentary.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. "On Heraclitus." American Journal of Philology 76 (1955): 337-68. Reprinted in G. Vlastos, Studies in Greek Philosophy, vol. 1, Princeton: Princeton U. Pr., 1995.
    • Vigorous defense of the traditional interpretation of Heraclitus against Kirk and others.

Author Information

Daniel W. Graham
Email: daniel_graham@byu.edu
Brigham Young University
U. S. A.

Hipparchia (fl. 300 B.C.E.)

HipparchiaHipparchia is notable for being one of the few women philosophers of Ancient Greece.  Drawn to the doctrines and the self-imposed hardships of the Cynic lifestyle, Hipparchia lived in poverty with her husband, Crates the Cynic. While no existing writings are directly attributed to Hipparchia, recorded anecdotal accounts emphasize both her direct, Cynic rhetoric and her nonconformity to traditional gendered roles. Entering into marriage is a traditional social role that Cynics would normally reject; yet with her marriage to Crates, Hipparchia raised  Greek cultural expectations regarding the role of women in marriage, as well as the Cynic doctrine itself. With her husband, Hipparchia publicly embodied fundamental Cynic principles, specifically that the path toward virtue was the result of rational actors living in accordance with a natural law that eschewed conventional materialism and embraced both self-sufficiency and mental asperity.  Written accounts of Hipparchia's life reference in particular both her belief in human shamelessness or anaideia, and her rhetorical acuity at Greek symposiums traditionally attended only by men.  Along with Crates, Hipparchia is considered a direct influence on the later school of Stoicism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Philosophy
  2. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Philosophy

Hipparchia was a Cynic philosopher from Maroneia in Thrace, who flourished around 300 B.C.E. She became famous for her marriage to Crates the Cynic, and infamous for supposedly consummating the marriage in public. Hipparchia was likely born between 340 and 330 B.C.E., and was probably in her mid-teens when she decided to adopt the Cynic mantle. She may have been introduced to philosophy by her brother, Metrocles, who was a pupil in Aristotle’s Lyceum and later began to follow Crates. Most of our knowledge about Hipparchia comes from anecdotes and sayings repeated by later authors. Diogenes Laertius reports that she wrote some letters, jokes and philosophical refutations, which are now lost (see Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Vol. II, tr. R. D. Hicks, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1925, reprint 1995, VI.96-98). He adds that myriad stories were told about “the female philosopher”.

Diogenes Laertius claims that Hipparchia was so eager to marry Crates that she threatened to kill herself rather than live in any other way. (DL VI.96.7-8) Although Crates was by this time an old man, she rejected her other youthful suitors because she had fallen in love with “both the discourses and the life” of Crates, and was said to be “captured” by the logos of the Cynics. (VI.96.1 and 4-5) At the request of her parents, Crates tried to talk Hipparchia out of the marriage. (VI.96.9-10) When he failed in this task, he disrobed in front of her and said, “this is the groom, and these are his possessions; choose accordingly.” (VI.96.11-15) This tale should be taken with the proverbial grain of salt, given that Diogenes Laertius is writing centuries later, and that his account may include ‘apt’ stories that are technically false, but which arose and were transmitted because they were taken to be revealing illustrations. Given the interest and controversy generated by the female Cynic, it is easy to imagine stories of this kind being told about her. In any event, we know that Hipparchia chose to marry Crates and share his philosophical pursuits.

Hipparchia’s decision to become a Cynic was surprising, on account of both the Cynic disregard for conventional institutions and the extreme hardship of the lifestyle. Cynics attempted to live “according to nature” by rejecting artificial social conventions and refusing all luxuries, including any items not absolutely required for survival. They gave up their possessions, carrying what few they needed in a wallet. They wore only a simple mantle or cloak, and begged to obtain their basic needs. Crates’ willingness to marry was also unusual, considering that marriage is a social institution of the sort normally rejected by Cynics, and earlier Cynics like Diogenes and Antisthenes had maintained that the philosopher would never marry. A few centuries later, while arguing that marriage is generally unsuitable for the Cynic (or Stoic) philosopher, Epictetus allows for exceptions specifically because of the philosophical marriage of Hipparchia and Crates (Epictetus, Discourses, tr. C. H. Oldfather, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1928). By marrying a Cynic and becoming one herself, Hipparchia thus performed the characteristically Cynic feat of “changing the currency,” both of her culture and the Cynic tradition itself. The Cynic motto of “change the currency” (parakrattein to nomismata), first adopted by Diogenes of Sinope, implied rejection of the prevailing social and political order in favor of an unconventional, self-sufficient life as a “citizen of the universe” (kosmopolites). (It had been said, perhaps falsely, that Diogenes or his father had been driven from Sinope when found guilty of literally defacing the coins and changing their values, but it is also likely that the counterfeiting story arose after he adopted the metaphorical motto.)

Some later authors, such as Apuleius and Augustine, report that Hipparchia and Crates consummated their marriage by having sex on a public porch. Whether the tale is accurate or not, they were known to conduct themselves in all respects according to the Cynic value of anaideia, or shamelessness. The story of Hipparchia’s Cynic marriage quickly became the premiere example of that virtue, which is based on the Cynic belief that any actions virtuous enough to be done in private are no less virtuous when performed in public. As exemplars of anaideia, Hipparchia and Crates influenced their pupil Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism. His Republic advocates the equality of the sexes, co-ed public exercise and training, and a version of “free love” wherein those wishing to have sex will simply satisfy their desires wherever they happen to be at the moment, even in public. Stoic ethics were generally influenced by Cynic values, such as self-sufficiency, the importance of practice in achieving virtue, and the rejection of the conventional values attached to pleasure and pain. The Stoics also advocated living according to nature in the sense of conforming one’s own reason to the dictates of the rational natural law.

Eratosthenes reports that Hipparchia and Crates had a son named Pasicles, and Diogenes Laertius’ account of the life of Crates also refers to their son. The Cynic Letters, a collection of pseudographic letters attributed to various Cynic figures and probably written by a several different authors a few centuries after Hipparchia lived, mention that she bore and raised children according to her Cynic values. Whatever the actual details of her practices might have been, her example influenced later Cynic attitudes towards pregnancy and child-rearing. For example, one of the letters attributed to Crates suggests that Hipparchia has given birth “without trouble” because she believes that her usual “labor is the cause of not laboring” during the birth itself (33.14-15). The birth was easier because she continued to work “like an athlete” during her pregnancy (33.17), which the author notes is unusual. The letters also mention Hipparchia’s use of a tortoise shell cradle, cold water for the baby’s bath, and continued adherence to an austere diet.

Hipparchia is also famous for an exchange with Theodorus the Atheist, a Cyrenaic philosopher, who had challenged the legitimacy of her presence at a symposium. She was reported to have regularly attended such functions with Crates. According to Diogenes Laertius, Theodorus quoted a verse from Euripides’ Bacchae, asking if this is she “abandoning the warp and woof and the shuttle” (like Agave returning home from the “hunt” with the head of her son Pentheus). (VI.98.2) Hipparchia affirms that yes, it is she, but asks Theodorus whether she has had the wrong understanding of herself, if she spent her time on education rather than wasting it on the loom. (VI.98.3-6) In the ancient Greek cultural context, women of her social class typically would have been occupied with weaving and organizing the household servants, and Hipparchia’s rejection of the conventional expectations for women was quite radical.

Diogenes Laertius also reports the syllogism that Hipparchia used to put down Theodorus during the same symposium mentioned above: Premise 1: “Any action which would not be called wrong if done by Theodorus, would not be called wrong if done by Hipparchia.” Premise 2: “Now Theodorus does no wrong when he strikes himself”. Conclusion: “therefore neither does Hipparchia do wrong when she strikes Theodorus.” (VI.97.6-9) This is a classic example of the Cynic rhetorical trope of spoudogeloion: a deliberately comic syllogism which nevertheless makes a serious point. Diogenes Laertius says that since Theodorus “had no reply wherefore to meet the argument,” he “tried to strip her of her cloak. But Hipparchia showed no sign of alarm or of the perturbation natural in a woman” (VI.97), as befitted her Cynic commitment to anaideia.

2. References and Further Reading

Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Vol. II, tr. R. D. Hicks (Cambridge: Harvard University Press) 1925 (reprint 1995), VI.96-98.

Abraham J. Malherbe, The Cynic Epistles (Atlanta: Scholar’s Press) 1997, 78-83.

Discussions in the modern period of Hipparchia’s encounter with Theodorus are found in Bayle’s Historical and Critical Dictionary and in Menage’s History of Women Philosophers. See Pierre Bayle, Historical and Critical Dictionary: Selections, ed. Richard H. Popkin and Craig Bush (Indianapolis: Hackett) 1991, 102-103, and Gilles Menage, The History of Women Philosophers, tr. Beatrice H. Zedler (Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1984), 103.

For further information about Cynic philosophy, see Diogenes Laertius Book VI, as well as D. R. Dudley, A History of Cynicism: From Diogenes to the Sixth Century AD (London) 1937 (reprint Ares Publishing, 1980), and R. Bracht Branham and Marie Odile Goulet-Caze, eds., The Cynics: The Cynic Movement in Antiquity and its Legacy (Berkeley: University of California Press) 2000.

Author Information

Laura Grams
Email: lgrams@mail.unomaha.edu
University of Nebraska at Omaha
U. S. A.

Hippocrates (c. 450—c. 380 B.C.E.)

HippocratesHippocrates of Cos was said to have lived sometime between 450 BCE to 380 BCE. He was a physician, and the writings of the Corpus Hippocraticum provide a wealth of information on biomedical methodology and offer one of the first reflective codes of professional ethics. Though Plato (a contemporary) makes reference to Hippocrates (Phaedrus 270a and elsewhere), it is generally believed that most of the writings in the Corpus Hippocraticum are actually the work of a number of different writers. By convention of time, place and general approach a common name of 'Hippocrates' was assigned to the lot (without distinguishing those of the historical Hippocrates). Hippocrates and the other associated writers provide the modern student with a number of different sorts of insights.

On the biomedical methodology side, these writings provide the most detailed biomedical observations to date in the Western world. They also offer causal speculations that can be knitted together to form a theoretical framework for diagnosis and treatment. On the ethical side, their code of professional ethics is so well structured that it continues to stand as a model for other professions.

Table of Contents

  1. Biomedical Methodology
    1. The Four Humors
    2. An Ancient Debate: Are General Causal Theories Beneficial?
    3. Prognosis and Treatment
    4. The Hippocratic Writings and Hellenistic Medicine
  2. Ethics
    1. The Oath
    2. The Oath and Modern Codes of Conduct
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Published Conferences on Hippocrates

1. Biomedical Methodology

One way to parse the groups of Hippocratic writers revolves around their geographical origins: Cos vs. Cnidos. Though this classification is controversial, it is useful (whether one accepts the literal geographical demarcation) to mark some clear distinctions in the Hippocratic body of writing. It appears to be the case that the Cos writers sought to create general biomedical "laws" that for the most part would give the explanation for why someone was sick. Any physician might make reference to these "laws" and thereby have an etiology for the disease, and by extension a strategy for treatment.

a. The Four Humors

The most historically prominent theoretical scheme of the Coan writers was the doctrine of the four humors of the body: blood, phlegm, black bile, and yellow bile (or sometimes serum). Health was defined as the balance of the four humors. Disease was defined as the imbalance of the humors. When imbalance occurred, then the physician might intervene by making a correction to bring the body back into balance. For example, if the individual were too full of phlegm (making her phlegmatic or lethargic), then the phlegm must be countered. Citrus fruit was thought to be a counter-acting agent. Thus, if one feels lethargic, increasing one's citrus intake will re-create balance. The treatment is, in fact, generally effective. Moderns might describe the therapy differently by ascribing the effect to vitamin-C, phosphorus, and natural sugar. This example illustrates the scope of the Hippocratic physician in this context: something like a cross between the modern roles of an herbalist dietician and a personal trainer. Nonetheless, the cures that were dictated by the four humor theory seemed to work well enough for this theory to extend to the nineteenth century (in various guises).

b. An Ancient Debate: Are General Causal Theories Beneficial?

Other biomedical writers--some say from Cnidos--held that strict empirical principles did not allow scientists to go far beyond the data. It was a better methodology for the biomedical practitioner to stay as close as possible to the data that were before him. This meant that each patient would be seen in her particularity. Such a method required careful trial and error observation and only slight manipulation of the patient in the form of treatment.

There was a great conflict in the ancient world concerning the status of observational conclusions (the empirically concrete). Should they be given in their specificity and remain as disparate, individual accounts, or should they be grouped and more general principles drawn from them? In this instance it was very much in dispute whether it was better to set out individual reports of particular illnesses (case studies) or to try to draw general rules from the particulars.

Take, for example Epidemics III:

THE MORTIFICATION OF THE GANGRENE. If the gangrene mortifies itself there is a head pain and frequently a scratchy throat; the sick limb loses sensation, a feeling of cold comes to the head and the affected limb sweats. He suddenly loses his speech and blows blood from his nose as he becomes pale. If the disease takes hold of the patient with a weak force, he recovers the discharged blood. If the disease takes him with a strong force, he dies promptly. In this case one induces sneezing by pleasant substances; one evacuates by the upper and lower. Alternatively those odors will be a little active. The soup will be light and hot. Wine is absolutely forbidden. (Epidemics III, Littré 7, p. 123)

In this passage one is left merely with symptoms and treatment. But when one practices medicine in this way there are severe restrictions. For the disease is seen as a collection of symptoms. The cure can only be guessed at unless it has been previously written down in a manual. When a physician is confronted with a novel disease he must find a similar set of symptoms and use that treatment. This aspect of the "trial and error" method brought harsh rebuke from Galen.

The point is that they [the Cnidians] looked at the varieties of symptoms which change for many reasons and failed to consider the specificity of the dispositions, as did Hippocrates, who used for their discovery a method only by using which, one can find the number of diseases . . . . Hippocrates censures the Cnidian physicians for their ignorance of the genera and species of diseases, and he points out the divisions by which what seems to be one becomes many by being divided. (Corpus Medicorum Graecorum 5.9.1, pp. 121-22; Claudii Galeni De Placitis Hippocratis et Platonis, ed. I. Mueller (Lipsiae, 1874), p. 776)

c. Prognosis and Treatment

What was it that made the Cnidians different from the Coan writers? This can be found by examining the two steps in any medical practice: Prognosis and Treatment. In the Coan work, On Prognosis, the writer suggests that prognosis consists in knowing the patient's condition in the past, present, and the future. Now how could a physician know this? Well, this could also have been part of a handbook catalogued through similar case studies. The practitioner could memorize each individual description. Next, the practitioner could add to this his own experience. But the problem is that each case is individual. It possesses "nature" only in the sense of possessing a unique set of properties. The practitioner would not be in a good position to treat novel cases. When confronted with a novel case, the practitioner is left with seeking similar cases. The implied premise is that similar cases call for similar remedies. The more the experience, the more refined the practitioner can be in balancing similar cases with the remedies.

Obviously, much rides on the word, 'similar.' Is a rich body of knowledge enough? Is it not also requisite to have a classification procedure, which itself implies rules of classification. And how does one select and justify such rules? It would seem that we are pressed backwards toward archai, starting points for some axiomatic system (à la Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, I, i-ii).

Such an alternative to the empiricist program aims at establishing a theory of causes that underlie individual cases. These causes such as the "hot," "cold," "wet," and "dry" or "the four humors" are more general because they seek to describe a different sense of the nature of disease. 'Nature' in this context refers to the sort of condition that comes from observations based upon the individuality of actual patients. For here we are interested in the genera and species of the disease in question. Such an exercise creates a classification of types of diseases.

But for this classification not to be based upon accidental characteristics, it is requisite that it include the causal factors that operate to bring about the disease in the first place. This is really the foundational or causal network that is responsible for the disease's very existence. Such an understanding of "nature" moves away from individuals and their "similarities" toward the theoretical. Understood in this way, the nature of disease is a regulating factor upon the prognosis of the physician. This nature must be understood in order to offer treatment. In this sense, nature is the overarching principles that give an account of the mechanism of the disease. What made the Coan writers so attractive to Galen was that they investigated various senses of nature while the Cnidians confined themselves only to the data as they presented themselves.

d. The Hippocratic Writings and Hellenistic Medicine

The Hippocratic writings were influential in the development of later biomedical practitioners. The three principal Hellenistic schools: Dogmatists, Methodists, and the Empirics all hearken back in various ways to the Hippocratic writings. Many debates in the Hippocratic writings (such as the "preformation" vs. "epigenesis" debate) are picked-up again and given a twist according to the predilections of the Hellenistic schools. Galen, himself, often cites Hippocrates, aka "the Hippocratic writers," as the point of departure for his own theory building. Thus, it would be fair to say that not only were the Hippocratic writers the first systematic biomedical writers in the Western tradition, but also the most influential to later writers.

2. Ethics

In the time of Hippocrates (and the other associated writers) there were many who wanted to pass themselves off as physicians. These individuals had not gone through an apprenticeship and thus had no specialized (professional) knowledge. Because of this, these con men went about fleecing customers. This created a problem for those who entered the study of medicine the traditional way. These more careful practitioners had to distinguish themselves from the charlatans. The way most professions try to deal with this sort of problem and the legitimate problems that arise during practice is to create codes of conduct and structures of accreditation. The most famous of these in the biomedical tradition is: The Oath of Hippocrates.

a. The Oath

By Apollo (the physician), by Asclepius (god of healing), by Hygeia (god of health), by Panacea (god of remedy), and all the gods and goddesses, together as witnesses, I hereby swear that I will carry out, inasmuch as I am able and true to my considered judgment, this oath and the ensuing duties:

  1. To hold my teacher in this art on a par with my parents. To make my teacher a partner in my livelihood To look after my teacher and financially share with her/him when s/he is in need. To consider him/her as a brother/sister along with his/her family. To teach his/her family the art of medicine, if they want to learn it, without tuition or any other conditions of service. To impart all the lessons necessary to practice medicine to my own sons and daughters, the sons and daughters of my teacher and to my own students, who have taken this oath-but to no one else.
  2. I will help the sick according to my skill and judgment, but never with an intent to do harm or injury to another.
  3. I will never administer poison to anyone-even when asked to do so. Nor will I ever suggest a way that others (even the patient) could do so. Similarly, I will never induce an abortion. Instead, I will keep holy my life and art.
  4. I will not engage in surgery--not even upon suffers from stone, but will withdraw in favor of others who do this work.
  5. Whoever I visit, rich or poor, I will concern myself with the well being of the sick. I will commit no intentional misdeeds, nor any other harmful action such as engaging in sexual relations with my patients (regardless of their status).
  6. Whatever I hear or see in the course of my professional duties (or even outside the course of treatment) regarding my patients is strictly confidential and I will not allow it to be spread about. But instead, will hold these as holy secrets.

Now if I carry out this oath and not break its injunctions, may I enjoy a good life and may my reputation be pure and honored for all generations. But if I fail and break this oath, then may the opposite befall me.

Within this oath are both a moral code for the profession of medicine and the outlines of a system of accreditation for new physicians via an apprenticeship. These two functions went a long way to establishing medicine as a profession that ordinary people could trust.

b. The Oath and Modern Codes of Conduct

In the modern world there are many professional codes of conduct. One could look at the American Medical Association Code, the American Bar Association Code, et al. However, the Hippocratic Oath set the standard of what a professional code is. A few key features that will tell why one should accept or reject such codes as solutions to the problems that have been outlined.

It is this author's opinion that among professional codes, the Hippocratic Oath is a good one. It balances between very specific prohibitions such as not administering poison or not having sexual relations with one's patients, to more general principles such as "I will concern myself with the well being of the sick." and "do no harm." These general principles are very useful because they govern a larger domain than simply prohibiting a particular action. These principles are not set out without context. Instead they are put into the context medicine's mission.

Beginning in #1 the tone is set that medicine is an art that is "given by the gods." It is an esoteric art that is to be reserved for those who are willing to commit to the provisions of the code. Thus, it is not open to everyone. This fulfills the condition of specialized knowledge mentioned earlier. It is for the sake of doing good to others and always avoiding harm. This fulfills the condition of providing a service for others.

Thirdly, the code ties itself to the larger moral tradition, "I will commit no intentional misdeeds." Whereas "harm" has a direct link to manner in which medicine is practiced, "misdeeds" links the physician to the larger moral tradition. There is no possible hiding in the shared community perspective alone.

These three factors are the basis of any good professional code.

A Good Professional Code Should Contain

  1. A specific listing of common abuses.
  2. A few general guidelines that tie behavior to the mission of the profession.
  3. A link to general theories of morality.

Where codes of professional ethics fail is in overemphasizing one of these elements too highly or in ignoring an element entirely. If codes of ethics exist in order to remedy the "inward perspective" problem described above, then they must create links to more general "shared worldviews." This would put them in the realm of common morality.

This is the most important point from my perspective. So often the "practice" of the profession defines its excellence in an introspective way such that the achievement of these functional requirements is all that matters-divorced from any other visions, namely, moral visions.

In the modern arena, many professional codes have evolved from a legal perspective. The practitioners of the profession do not want to go to jail or to be sued. Thus, they create certain codes that will make this possible situation less probable. These sorts of codes are defensive in nature and stand at the opposite end of the spectrum from the Hippocratic Oath. Their mission is not to set internal standards and link to common morality, rather they seek to "shave" as close as possible to maximizing an egoistic bottom line at the expense of the pillars of professionalism: one's specialized education and one's mission to serve others.

Any code that takes as its basis merely a negative approach designed to protect the practitioner from going to jail or being sued is fundamentally inadequate. This is not where one should set her sights. Rather, we should dream about what the profession may be-in the best of all possible worlds. The Oath of Hippocrates thus properly sets the mission that should drive all codes of ethics.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Corpus Medicorum Graecorum (Berlin: Akademie-Verlag, on-going).
    • New editions of selected texts with excellent notes and apparatus by various editors.
  • Hippocrate, Oeuvres. Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 1967-2008.
  • Hippocrates, selected works Loeb series. 8 vols. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1923-1995.
  • Littré, E. Oeuvres complète d'hippocrate 10 vols. (Paris: J. B. Billière, 1851).
    • The standard edition.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bourgey, Louis, Observation et experience chez les médecins de la collection hippocratique. (Paris: J. Vrin, 1953).
    • A fine connection to principles in the philosophy of science.
  • Edelstein, Ludwig Ancient Medicine. (Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1967).
    • Still the best single treatment of ancient biomedical practitioners.
  • Jouanna, Jacques. Hipporcrate Translated as Hippocrates by M. B. DeBevoise (Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1999).
    • A broad and speculative treatment.
  • Jouanna, Jacques. Hippocrate: pour une archéologie d l'école de Cnide. (Paris: Belles Lettres, 1974).
    • A fine detailed analysis.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Early Greek Science: Thales to Aristotle. (New York: Norton, 1970).
    • An overview for the student interested in an introduction.
  • Lloyd, G.E.R. Magic, Reason, and Experience. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1979).
    • Perhaps Lloyd's best analytical work by one of the finest practitioners of ancient scientific history.
  • Smith, Wesley. The Hippocratic Tradition. (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1979). Second edition revised 2002 - available online at: http://www.bium.univ-paris5.fr/amn/Hippo2.pdf (accessed on August 26, 2009).
    • A solid overview by an excellent scholar.
  • Temkin, Owsei. Hippocrates in a World of Pagans and Christians. (Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1991).
    • A wide-ranging work that stimulates in the tradition of the history of ideas.

c. Published Conferences on Hippocrates

#1 French

  • La Collection Hippocratique et son role dans l'histoire medicine : Colloque de Strasbourg (23-27 Octobre 1972). (1975). Paper presented at the Colloque Sur La Collection Hippocratique Et Son Role Dans l'Histoire Medicale (1972 : Strasbourg); Universite Des Sciences Humaines De Strasbourg. Centre De Recherche Sur La Proche-Orient Et La Grece Antiques. Travaux, 2.

#2 French

  • Joly, R., (1977). Corpus hippocraticum : Actes du Colloque Hippocratique de Mons (22-26 Septembre 1975). Paper presented at the Colloque Hippocratique, 2nd, Mons, 1975.; Éditions Universitaires De Mons. Série Sciences Humaines ; 4.

#3 French

  • Grmek, M. D. (1980). Hippocratica : Actes du Colloque Hippocratique de Paris, 4-9 Septembre 1978. Paper presented at the Colloque Hippocratique De Paris (1978); Colloques Internationaux Du Centre National De La Recherche Scientifique ; no 583; Variation: Colloques Internationaux Du Centre National De La Recherche Scientifique ; no 583.

#4 French

  • Lasserre, F., & Mudry, P. (1983). Formes de pensée dans la collection Hippocratique : Actes du IVe Colloque International Hippocratique : Lausanne, 21-26 Septembre 1981. Paper presented at the International Hippocrates Colloquium (4th : 1981 : Lausanne, Switzerland); Publications De La Faculté Des Lettres ; 26; Variation: Publications De La Faculté Des Lettres (Université De Lausanne. Faculté Des Lettres) ; 26.

#5 German

  • Baader, G., Winau, R., Berliner Gesellschaft für Geschichte der Medizin, Freie Universität Berlin, & Institut für Geschichte der Medizin. (1989). Die Hippokratischen epidemien : Theorie-praxis-tradition : Verhandlungen des ve Colloque International Hippocratique. Paper presented at the International Hippocrates Colloquium (5th : 1984 : Berlin, Germany); Sudhoffs Archiv,; Beihefte ; Heft 27, 441.

#6 French

  • Potter, P., Maloney, G., & Desautels, J. (1990). La maladie et les maladies dans la Collection Hippocratique : Actes du VIe Colloque International Hippocratique, Québec du 28 Septembre au 3 Octobre 1987. Paper presented at the Colloque International Hippocratique (6e : 1987 : Québec, Québec),

#7 Spanish

  • López Férez, J. A. (1992). Tratados hipocráticos : Estudios acerca de su contenido, forma e influencia : Actas del VIIe Colloque International Hippocratique, Madrid, 24-29 de Septiembre de 1990. Paper presented at the Colloque International Hippocratique (7th : 1990 : Madrid, Spain),

#8 German

  • Wittern, R., & Pellegrin, P. (1996). Hippokratische medizin und antike philosophie : Verhandlungen des VIII. Internationalen Hippokrates-Kolloquiums in Kloster Banz/Staffelstein vom 23.-28. Sept. 1993. Paper presented at the International Hippocrates Colloquium (8th : 1993 : Kloster Banz/Staffelstein); Medizin Der Antike; Bd. 1, 654.

#9 multiple languages

  • Garofalo, I. (1999). Aspetti della terapia nel corpus hippocraticum : Atti del IXe Colloque International Hippocratique, Pisa, 25-29 Settembre 1996. Paper presented at the International Hippocrates Colloquium (9th : 1996 : Pisa, Italy); Studi / Accademia Toscana Di Scienze e Lettere La Colombaria; 183; Variation: Studi (Accademia Toscana Di Scienze e Lettere La Colombaria); 183. 716.

#10 French

  • Thivel, A., & Zucker, A. (2002). Le normal et le pathologique dans la collection Hippocratique : Actes du xème Colloque International Hippocratique, Nice, 6-8 Octobre 1999. Paper presented at the Colloque International Hippocratique (10th : 1999 : Nice, France),

#11 English

Author Information

Michael Boylan
Email: michael.boylan@marymount.edu
Marymount University
U. S. A.

Johann Georg Hamann (1730—1788)

HamannJohann Georg Hamann was the philosophically most sophisticated thinker of the German Counter-enlightenment. Born in 1730 in Königsberg in eastern Prussia, Hamann was a contemporary and friendly acquaintance of the philosopher Immanuel Kant, and in many ways Hamann’s career can be seen in parallel to that of his great friend. Like Kant, Hamann attended the University of Königsberg, and in his early life was a devoted partisan of the Enlightenment, the philosophical and literary movement that emphasized the clearing away of outdated prejudice and the application of scientific reason to every area of human life. But during a business trip to London (on behalf of the firm of the Berens family, who also published Kant’s works), Hamann underwent a sort of conversion that involved giving up his commitment to the secular Enlightenment in favor of a more orthodox view of Protestant Christianity. As a consequence, he embarked on a career of trenchant and often scathing criticism of the Enlightenment. This change in world-views coincided with his reading of the British empiricist philosophers George Berkeley and David Hume. Hamann saw the idealism of the former and the skepticism of the latter as constituting a reductio ad absurdum of Enlightenment thought: Scientific reason leads us inevitably either to doubt or to deny the reality of the world around us. Three of Hamann’s intellectual achievements are of particular significance: His writings Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten (Socratic Memorabilia) and Aesthetica in nuce (Aesthetics in a Nutshell), in which he opposed Enlightenment thought with an indirect and ironic mode of discourse emphasizing the importance of aesthetic experience and the role of genius in intuiting nature; his views on language; and his influential criticisms of Kant’s critical thought, expressed in his "Metakritik über den Purismum der Vernunft" and in his commentary, in a letter to Johann Gottfried Herder, on Kant’s essay "What is Enlightenment?"

Table of Contents

  1. Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten and Aesthetica in nuce
  2. Hamann’s Views on Language
  3. "Metacritique" of Kant
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Works in German
    2. Works in English
    3. Works in English that Discuss Hamann

1. Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten and Aesthetica in nuce

Hamann's rejection of the Enlightenment was greeted with distress by his friends Kant and Berens. Although they hoped that he could be won back to the cause of reason, these hopes were dashed with the publication in 1759 of Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten, and the following year of Aesthetica in nuce. Together these two works offer a world-view that might be described as antirationalist but not irrationalist.

Hamann's intention in the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten is to offer a defense of religious faith that renders such faith immune against rational attack while in no way accepting the rationalist’s terms of debate. In order to do this, however, he faces a seemingly insoluble problem: He must undermine the grounds of the Enlightenment view of reason and religion without committing himself to other, opposed positions that are subject to rational criticism and refutation. Several aspects of how he goes about this were very influential in German thought in the 18th century. First, the work is written under a pseudonym, or rather, not under any name at all: The title page says that the Denkwürdigkeiten were "assembled for the boredom of the public by a lover of boredom," most likely a reference to the Enlighteners’ desire to educate the public in the name of reason. By distancing himself from the authorship of what was probably his most important work, Hamann makes clear that any arguments offered or positions taken in the book ought to be viewed as moves in a game rather than as expressions of his rational faculty. Second, Hamann makes crucial use of irony, specifically Socratic irony, in his attack on the Enlightenment. "I have," says Hamann at the beginning of the work, "written about Socrates in a Socratic manner. Analogy was the soul of his syllogisms, and he gave them irony as their body." Specifically, Hamann holds up Socrates, the philosophers’ secular saint, in order to draw an unfavorable contrast between him and the Enlightenment. Despite his wisdom, Socrates explicitly renounced his claim to know the answers to the questions he asked; rather than taking and defending determinate positions on the issues he was interested in, Socrates engaged his listeners in conversation so as to bring them to realize that they did not know the answers to these questions any more than Socrates did. Similarly, Hamann intends the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten to show that Berens and Kant are (at least) as far from genuine knowledge as he is. Finally, like all of Hamann’s works, the style of the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten is intentionally opaque: In contrast to the Enlightenment emphasis on universal truths that transcend the time and place in which they are expressed, Hamann fills his text with oblique allusions to a wide variety of texts in several languages; moves from one point to another with little indication of how the various passages are supposed to hang together; and shifts without warning from careful argumentative analysis to citation of texts to something like oracular declamation. As a result, it is impossible for the reader to forget that the text she is reading is the work of a particular individual writing in a particular time and place, rather than expressing timeless deliverances of reason.

How then does the text of the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten accomplish the defense of religious faith Hamann desires? The chief contention of the work is that religious faith is neither based on nor subject to reason. Here Hamann relies not so much on Socrates but rather on David Hume, whose skeptical writings had affected him so deeply a few years before. Hume would doubtless have found little to his liking in Hamann's rejection of the Enlightenment, but Hamann found much in Hume to serve his purposes. Specifically, Hamann adapts Hume’s important claim that "belief... [etc.]." Hume intends this as a way of answering the worst sort of skepticism: If our beliefs are not based on reasoning, then reasoning cannot threaten them, either. Hamann makes use of the fact that in German there is one word, 'Glaube,’ that corresponds both to ‘belief’ and to ‘faith’ in English. Thus in his hands Hume’s claim is extended to religious faith as well, making it immune from rational criticism. But this is not to be understood as a position taken with debates about the philosophical foundations of religion. Instead, Hamann again makes use of the figure of Socrates. He compares Socrates to someone refusing to join a game of cards: If this person didn’t know how to play, Hamann observes, we might take their refusal as an expression of incapacity, much as we would take an expression of ignorance from an ordinary person as a genuine indication that he lacks knowledge. But in the case of Socrates, who was manifestly a deep thinker and great philosopher, professions of ignorance must be read as refusals to participate in a game in which the other players "break the rules of the game and steal its joy [das Glück desselben stehlen]. Socrates’ ignorance thus became a "thorn in the eyes" of the sophists (here again Kant and Berens are clearly intended) and serve as "testimony" against the "new Athenians" of Hamann’s time, who deified Socrates "in order to be better able to mock the carpenter’s son [Jesus]."

But if Socrates was a great philosopher, as Hamann emphasizes, what can he be said to know? Hamann's answer to this question is 'genius.’

What in Homer makes up for the ignorance of artistic rules, that Aristotle thought up after him, and what in Shakespeare makes up for the ignorance or violation of these rules? Genius (Genie) is the unambiguous answer. Socrates could thus well have been ignorant; he had a genius (Genius) on whose knowledge he could rely, and who he feared as his God.Hamann's use of the notion of genius in the Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten serves as a bridge to his second major work, the Aesthetica in nuce. His target in the Aesthetica is Enlightenment thought as it applies specifically to art and beauty. Aesthetics in the Enlightenment alternated between attempts to reduce art to rules, more specifically rules for the accurate and morally uplifting imitation of nature, and attempts to explain art as a response to the subjective human capacity for feeling and sensation. Hamann emphatically rejects both of these tendencies, along with the devaluation of the aesthetic he seems them as implying. Far from being reducible to rational principles, in his view aesthetic experience is a fundamental and immediate experience of nature, which he encapsulates (both in the Aesthetica and in Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten) under the term 'genius.’

The chief philosophical significance of the Aesthetica in nuce is that Hamann here deepens his conception of the connection between artistic genius, nature, and God. Nature, he says, is "a speech through creation to creation." That is, nature is a text written by God, which, being creatures ourselves, we are able to understand through His grace. But this understanding is of course not a rational one, through concepts and scientific investigation. Rather, in aesthetic experience we grasp nature in a manner that precedes, and indeed forms the basis for, rational thought: "Poetry [Poesie] is the native tongue of the human race, just as gardening is older than agriculture, painting older than writing, chant older than declamation, similes older than conclusions, and barter than trade." This view has radical consequences for the Enlightenment. Whereas the task of philosophical aesthetics in the early modern period was to incorporate aesthetic experience into the rational worldview, Hamann now argues that we must instead do the former, that is, view reason as one aspect of our aesthetic experience of the world. It is thus pointless to try to formulate rational standards for beauty. Second, giving art priority over reason threatens reason's claim to be the proper form for representing nature, which is crucial to the central role given in the Enlightenment to natural science. Finally, if reason is subordinated to art rather than the reverse, then in so far as there is a tension between artistic and rational views of the world the value placed on reason in the 18th-century represents not progress but regress. Hamann’s early writings inspired thinkers such as Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, who appropriated the skeptical arguments of David Hume to argue that reason is based entirely on faith, and Johann Gottfried Herder, who offered an account of human thought that emphasized the continuous historical development of humanity from its original natural state. More immediately, Hamann’s thought had an enormous impact on the literary movement known as the Sturm und Drang- literally, "storm and stress." Works of the Sturm und Drang emphasized nature and human passion. Indeed these two themes were closely linked, in that passion was seen as closer to nature. More distantly, Hamann’s thought was instrumental in the rise, around the turn of the century, of the Romantic movement in Germany.

2. Hamann's Views on Language

From his earliest works onward, language was a central theme in all of Hamann's writings. Here too his opposition to the Enlightenment was influential not only in his time but also in present-day philosophy and literary theory. Hamann’s account of language can best be understood by contrast with an admittedly too-simple sketch of the sort of view he opposed. Much Enlightenment thought on language was naturalistic, that is, it saw language as a useful tool invented by human beings. The original humans were thinking, rational beings who invented symbols, attaching names things in the world around them for purposes of communication and learning. Thus both reason and the world precede, and are independent of, language. Hamann rejects this view in all its particulars.

Important elements of Hamann's account of language are already visible in the Aesthetica in nuce, in particular in the claim that the world is "a speech through creation to creation." Here it is clear that language for Hamann is not something projected onto the world by human reason, but instead is as it were embedded in the things themselves by God the creator. At some points in his writings on language, Hamann maintains the position that language is simultaneously the work of both God and humans, while at other places he seems to lean more toward the view that God alone is the source of language. In any case, he clearly holds the view that neither thought nor reason is possible independently of language. Indeed, since God’s act of creation is in a sense inherently linguistic, he must hold that language precedes, or at least is contemporaneous with reason in particular and thought in general. As we will see, this is an idea that is very important for his critique of the philosophy of Immanuel Kant.

3. "Metacritique" of Kant

In 1781 Hamann's friend but philosophical opponent Immanuel Kant published his Critique of Pure Reason. Kant’s project in the Critique has two sides. On the one hand, Kant argues that reason is incapable of attaining knowledge of the existence of, for example, God and the immortality of the soul; however, these beliefs are also incapable of being refuted through reason. This much, of course, Hamann could gladly agree with. But Kant also undertakes to defend both reason and the claim of natural science to offer a privileged description of the world. The latter task is accomplished in the Transcendental Deduction of the Categories, in which Kant argues that our experience requires us to understand the natural world as being composed of substances interacting according to necessary causal laws discoverable by natural science. The former task (which is Hamann’s chief target) is accomplished by reinterpreting reason as the ability to set goals for human cognition and moral action. This alarmed Hamann because it put reason in the place of religious faith, along with the tradition and culture he thought essential to human understanding. In response to Kant’s work, which was the most important event in German philosophy in the 18th century, Hamann penned a short essay entitled "Metakritik über den Purismum der Vernunft" ("Metacritique on the Purism of Reason"). Although the Metacritique was never published in Hamann’s lifetime, he included it in a letter to his friend Johann Gottfried Herder (who was also a student of Kant’s), and Herder passed it on to Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi, thus enabling this small but interesting text to exert what one commentator has called a "subterranean influence" on German thought after Kant.

Hamann's thesis in the Metacritique is that "language is the center of reason’s misunderstanding with itself." More specifically, Hamann thinks that Kant’s critical philosophy, while maintaining that everything in the world must submit to rational questioning and appraisal, nevertheless overlooks the crucial fact that all use of reason, including Kant’s reason, depends on language: Kant imagines, he says, that he can simply "invent" a "universal philosophical language," whereas here and elsewhere Hamann maintains that words have meaning only in relation to the time and place where they are appropriate. Hamann is clearly on to something important here, because the force of Kant’s conclusions in the Critique of Pure Reason requires that we accept his quite substantial body of terminology, such as the distinctions between a priori and a posteriori, and between analytic and synthetic propositions. But, one might ask, why can’t one simply invent terms of art and stipulate their meanings? This is probably, in fact, what Kant saw himself as doing. Hamann answers this question indirectly, by appealing to the empiricists Berkeley and Hume. Both Berkeley and Hume reject the existence of so-called "abstract ideas," arguing that there is no philosophical justification for referring to anything in the world other than particular sensible things, whereas abstract ideas are things that can exist only in the privacy of human minds. Since Kant himself accepts the quasi-empiricist view that our knowledge is limited to possible experience, Hamann’s point is that Kant cannot justify his own philosophical enterprise unless he can offer a justification for the very language in which the enterprise is couched- a demand that seems impossible for Kant to fulfill.

Quite late in his life, Hamann participated in another intellectual dispute involving Kant, this one centering on the question, "What is enlightenment." Although Kant was not the first to contribute to this debate, his was the most prominent and influential statement on the question. In his essay, also entitled "What is Enlightenment?," Kant defines enlightenment as "the departure of human beings from their self-incurred incapacity." Its slogan, he says, is sapere aude!-- Dare to think! Ignorance on this view is a sort of moral failing in human beings who have neglected to exercise their rational faculties to the fullest extent possible. Hamann responded to Kant's essay not in print, but rather in a letter to a former student of Kant’s, Christian Jacob Kraus. Again, his target is the Enlightenment’s belief that reason rather than culture, tradition, or religious faith, is the proper guide for human life. His response to Kant turns on an important change in Kant’s language: For Kant’s word "incapacity" [Unmündigkeit] he substitutes the word "domination" [Vormundschaft]. Failure to be fully enlightened results, Hamann suggests, not from a failure to think for oneself, but rather from the fact that people are told what to think by people-like Kant– who see themselves as more rational and thus closer to the truth than ordinary mortals. Hamann thus rejects Kant’s view that the incapacity he bemoans is "self-incurred." Instead, the "enlightened" state replaces one dominant group (say, the aristocracy) with another ("Enlighteners" such as Kant). Here Hamann anticipates, at least in broad strokes, the late 20th-century suspicion that liberal democracy cannot live up to its own pretensions to universal tolerance, because viewing oneself as a citizen in a liberal democracy requires many of us to subordinate some of our most passionately held beliefs to the demands of citizenship.

Johann Georg Hamann died in 1788.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Works in German

  • Samtliche Werke, ed. by Josef Nadler (Vienna: Verlag Herder, 1951).
  • Schriften zur Sprache, ed. by Josef Simon (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp Verlag, 1967).
  • Sokratische Denkwurdigkeiten/Aesthetica in nuce, ed. by Sven-Aage Jorgenson (Stuttgart: Philipp Reclam Verlag, 1968).
  • Hamann and others, Was ist Aufklarung?, ed. by Ehrhard Bahr (Stuttgart: Philipp Reclam Verlag, 1974).

b. Works in English

  • Hamann's Socratic Memorabilia. A Translation and Commentary, trans. and ed. by James C. O’Flaherty (Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins Press, 1967).
  • What is Enlightenment? 18th Century Answers, 20th Century Questions
  • ed. by James B. Schmidt (Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1996).

c. Works in English that Discuss Hamann

  • Beiser, Frederick C., The Fate of Reason: German Philosophy from Kant to Fichte (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1987).
  • Berlin, Isaiah, The Magus of the North: J. G. Hamann and the Origins of Modern Irrationalism (New York: Farrar Straus and Giroux, 1993).
  • Dickson, Gwen G., Johann Georg Hamann's Relational Metacriticism (Berlin and New York: De Gruyter, 1995).
  • Kühn, Manfred, Kant: A Biography (New York : Cambridge University Press, 2001).
  • O' Flaherty, James C., The Quarrel of Reason with Itself: Essays on Hamann, Nietzsche, Lessing, & Michaelis (Rochester, NY: Camden House, 1991).

Author Information

Ted Kinnaman
Email: mailto:tkinnama@gmu.edu
George Mason University
U. S. A.

Luce Irigaray (1932—)

Luce Irigaray is a prominent author in contemporary French feminism and Continental philosophy. She is an interdisciplinary thinker who works between philosophy, psychoanalysis, and linguistics. Originally a student of the famous analyst Jacques Lacan, Irigaray's departure from Lacan in Speculum of the Other Woman, where she critiques the exclusion of women from both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory, earned her recognition as a leading feminist theorist and continental philosopher. Her subsequent texts provide a comprehensive analysis and critique of the exclusion of women from the history of philosophy, psychoanalytic theory and structural linguistics. Irigaray alleges that women have been traditionally associated with matter and nature to the expense of a female subject position. While women can become subjects if they assimilate to male subjectivity, a separate subject position for women does not exist. Irigaray's goal is to uncover the absence of a female subject position, the relegation of all things feminine to nature/matter, and, ultimately, the absence of true sexual difference in Western culture. In addition to establishing this critique, Irigaray offers suggestions for altering the situation of women in Western culture. Mimesis, strategic essentialism, utopian ideals, and employing novel language, are but some of the methods central to changing contemporary culture. Irigaray's analysis of women's exclusion from culture and her use of strategic essentialism have been enormously influential in contemporary feminist theory. Her work has generated productive discussions about how to define femininity and sexual difference, whether strategic essentialism should be employed, and assessing the risk involved in engaging categories historically used to oppress women. Irigaray's work extends beyond theory into practice. Irigaray has been actively engaged in the feminist movement in Italy. She has participated in several initiatives in Italy to implement a respect for sexual difference on a cultural and, in her most recent work, governmental level. Her contributions to feminist theory and continental philosophy are many and her complete works present her readers with a rewarding challenge to traditional conceptions of gender, self, and body.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Irigaray's Project
  3. Influences
    1. Psychoanalysis
    2. Philosophy
  4. Major Themes
    1. Mimesis
    2. Novel Language and Utopian Ideals
    3. Mother/Daughter Relationships
    4. Language
    5. Ethics
    6. Politics
  5. Criticisms
    1. Strategic Essentialism
    2. Privileges Psychological Oppression
    3. Elides Differences
    4. Opaque Writing Style
    5. Exclusive Ethics
    6. Later Work
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. English Translations
    2. Suggested Further Reading

1. Biography

In a 1993 interview with Margaret Whitford, Luce Irigaray specifically says that she does not like to be asked personal questions. She does not want opinions about her everyday life to interfere with interpretations of her ideas. Irigaray believes that entrance into intellectual discussions is a hard won battle for women and that reference to biographical material is one way in which women's credibility is challenged. It is no surprise that detailed biographical information about Irigaray is limited and that different accounts conflict.

What remains constant between accounts is that Luce Irigaray was born in Belgium in 1932. She holds two doctoral degrees-one in Philosophy and the other in Linguistics. She is also a trained and practicing psychoanalyst. She has held a research post at the Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique de Paris since 1964. She is currently the Director of Research in Philosophy at the center, and also continues her private practice. Perhaps the most well known fact of Irigaray's life-which Irigaray herself refers to in the opening of je, tu, nous-is her education at, and later expulsion from, the Ecole Freudienne de Paris (Freudian School of Paris). The Ecole Freudienne was founded by the famous psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan. Irigaray trained at the school in the sixties. In 1974, she published the thesis she wrote while studying at the school, Speculum, de l'autre femme, translated into English as Speculum of the Other Woman. This thesis criticized-among philosophical topics-the phallocentrism of Freudian and Lacanian psychoanalysis. The publication of this thesis gained her recognition, but also negatively affected Irigaray's career. She was relieved of her teaching post at the University of Vincennes and was ostracized by the Lacanian community. In spite of these early hardships, Irigaray went on to become an influential and prolific author in contemporary feminist theory and continental philosophy. In addition to her intellectual accomplishments, Irigaray is committed to active participation in the women's movement in both France and internationally-especially in Italy. Several of her later texts are dedicated to her work in the women's movement of Italy. She is still actively researching and publishing.

2. Irigaray's Project

Irigaray argues that, since ancient times, mothers have been associated with nature and unthinking matter. Further, Irigaray believes that all women have historically been associated with the role of "mother" such that, whether or not a woman is a mother, her identity is always defined according to that role. This is in contrast to men who are associated with culture and subjectivity. While excluded from culture and subjectivity, women serve as their unacknowledged support. In other words, while women are not considered full subjects, society itself could not function without their contributions. Irigaray ultimately states that Western culture itself is founded upon a primary sacrifice of the mother, and all women through her.

Based on this analysis, Irigaray says that sexual difference does not exist. True sexual difference would require that men and women are equally able to achieve subjectivity. As is, Irigaray believes that men are subjects (e.g. self-conscious, self-same entities) and women are "the other" of these subjects (e.g. the non-subjective, supporting matter). Only one form of subjectivity exists in Western culture and it is male. While Irigaray is influenced by both psychoanalytic theory and philosophy, she identifies them both as influential discourses that exclude women from a social existence as mature subjects. In many of her texts, Irigaray seeks to unveil how both psychoanalytic theory and philosophy exclude women from a genuine social existence as autonomous subjects, and relegate women to the realm of inert, lifeless, inessential matter. With this critique in place, Irigaray suggests how women can begin to reconfigure their identity such that one sex does not exist at the expense of the other. However, she is unwilling to definitively state what that new identity should be like. Irigaray refrains from prescribing a new identity because she wants women to determine for themselves how they want to be defined. While both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory are her targets, Irigaray identifies philosophy as the master discourse. Irigaray's reasons for this designation are revealed in Speculum of the Other Woman where she demonstrates how philosophy-since Ancient times-has articulated fundamental epistemological, ontological, and metaphysical truths from a male perspective that excludes women. While she is not suggesting that philosophy is single-handedly responsible for the history of women's oppression, she wants to emphasize that the similar type of exclusion manifest in both philosophy and psychoanalysis predates the birth of psychoanalysis. As the companion discourse to philosophy, psychoanalysis plays a unique role. While Irigaray praises psychoanalysis for utilizing the method of analysis to reveal the plight of female subjectivity, she also thinks that it reinforces it. Freud attempts to explain female subjectivity and sexuality according to a male model. From this perspective, female subjectivity looks like a deformed or insufficiently developed form of male subjectivity. Irigaray argues that if Freud had turned the tools of analysis onto his own discourse, then he would have seen that female subjectivity cannot be understood through the lenses of a one-sex model. In other words, negative views of women exist because of theoretical bias-not because of nature. Through her critiques of both philosophy and psychoanalytic theory, Irigaray argues that women need to attain a social existence separate from the role of mother. However, this alone will not change the current state of affairs. For Irigaray is not suggesting that the social role of women will change if they merely step over the line of nature into culture. Irigaray believes that true social change will occur only if society challenges its perception of nature as unthinking matter to be dominated and controlled. Thus, while women must attain subjectivity, men must become more embodied. Irigaray argues that both men and women have to reconfigure their subjectivity so that they both understand themselves as belonging equally to nature and culture. Irigaray's discussions of mimesis, novel language and utopian ideals, reconfiguring the mother/daughter relationship, altering language itself, ethics, and politics are all central to achieving this end.

3. Influences

Irigaray's interdisciplinary interests in philosophy, psychoanalysis, and linguistics underscore that her work has more than one influence. Two main discourses that maintain a strong presence throughout her work are psychoanalysis, with Sigmund Freud and Jacques Lacan as its representatives, and philosophy. Insofar as Lacanian psychoanalysis works out of a background in structural linguistics, both Lacan and Irigaray also focus on language. Irigaray engages with philosophy, psychoanalysis and linguistics in order to uncover the lack of true sexual difference in Western culture.

a. Psychoanalysis

Irigaray states on the opening page of An Ethics of Sexual Difference that each age is defined by a philosophical issue that calls to be thoroughly examined-ours is sexual difference. Sexual difference is often associated with the anatomical differences between the sexes. However, Irigaray follows the French psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan in understanding sexual difference as a difference that is assigned in language. While Irigaray is critical of Lacan, she is influenced by Lacan's interpretation of Freud's theory of subject formation.

Freud's work has served as a starting point for diverse psychoanalytic theories such as drive theory, object relations theory, and ego psychology. Lacan interprets Freud's work from a background in structural linguistics, philosophy, and, of course, psychoanalysis. Of particular importance to Irigaray's work is Lacan's claim that there are two key moments in the formation of a child's identity: the formation of an imaginary body and the assignation of sexual difference in language. Freud introduces the idea of an imaginary body in The Ego and the Id, in the section of the same name, when he describes the ego (self-consciousness) as neither strictly a psychic phenomenon nor a bodily phenomenon. Freud believes that an ego is formed in reference to a body, such that the manner in which an infant understands his or her selfhood is inseparable from his or her bodily existence. However, the body that an infant attributes to him or herself is not objectively understood-it is the mind's understanding of the body. This means that a person's understanding of his or her own body is imbued with a degree of fantasy and imagination. In his famous essay "The Mirror Stage as Formative of the I," Lacan expands Freud's comments on the bodily ego into a theory about imaginary anatomy. Lacan states that the first of two key moments in subject formation is the projection of an imaginary body. This occurs in the mirror stage at roughly six months. As a being who still lacks mobility and motor control, an infant who is placed in front of a mirror (another person can serve here as well, typically the mother) will identify with the unified, idealized image that is reflected back in the mirror. While the image in the mirror does not match the infant's experience, it is a key moment in the development of his or her ego. Rather than identify with him or herself as a helpless being, the child choose to identify with the idealized image of him or herself. Lacan believes that the element of fantasy and imagination involved in the identification with the mirror image marks the image as simultaneously representative and misrepresentative of the infant. While the body of the mirror stage is key to the infant's identity, it is also only an interpretation of his or her biological existence. In other words, according to Lacan, one's understanding of one's body occurs only in conjunction with an organization in language and image that begins in the mirror stage, and is further complicated by the next stage of ego formation-entrance into the Symbolic order. Irigaray agrees with Lacan that how we understand our biology is largely culturally influenced-thus does she accept the idea of an imaginary body. Irigaray employs the Lacanian imaginary body in her discussions about Western culture's bias against women. Irigaray argues that, like people, cultures project dominant imaginary schemes which then affect how that culture understands and defines itself. According to Irigaray, in Western culture, the imaginary body which dominates on a cultural level is a male body. Irigaray thus argues that Western culture privileges identity, unity, and sight-all of which she believes are associated with male anatomy. She believes that fields such as philosophy, psychoanalysis, science and medicine are controlled by this imaginary. Three examples from her work illustrate her view. In Speculum of the Other Woman, Irigaray addresses Freud's claim in his essay "Femininity" that little girls are only little men. She argues that Freud could not understand women because he was influenced by the one-sex theory of his time (men exist and women are a variation of men), and expanded his own, male experience of the world into a general theory applicable to all humans. According to Irigaray, since Freud was unable to imagine another perspective, his reduction of women to male experience resulted in viewing women as defective men. Another example is found in "Cosi Fan Tutti," (in This Sex Which Is Not One) where Irigaray argues that Lacan's ahistorical master signifier of the Symbolic order-the Phallus-is a projection of the male body. Irigaray argues that Lacan failed to diagnose the error of his predecessor, Freud, and similarly understood the world-and especially language-in terms of a one-sex model of sexuality and subjectivity. Although Lacan claims that the Phallus is not connected to male biology, his appropriation of Freud renders this claim false. A final example is found in "The Mechanics of 'Fluids'" (also in This Sex Which Is Not One) where Irigaray argues that science itself is biased towards categories typically personified as masculine (e.g. solids as opposed to fluids). Irigaray believes that if women are not understood in Western culture, it is because Western culture has yet to accept alternate paradigms for understanding them. While selfhood begins in the mirror stage with the imaginary body, it is not solidified until one enters the Symbolic order. According to Lacan, the Symbolic order is an ahistorical system of language that must be entered for a person to have a coherent social identity. The Phallus is the privileged master signifier of the Symbolic order. One must have a relationship to the Phallus if one is to attain social existence. According to Lacan, infants in the mirror stage do not differentiate between themselves and the world. For example, an infant views him or herself as continuous with his or her mother, and this understanding of the mother-child relationship organizes the infant's world. However, as the infant matures, he or she becomes aware that his or her mothers' attention is not wholly directed toward the infant in a reciprocal manner. The mother participates in a larger social context dominated by the Symbolic order. The infant fantasizes that if he or she could occupy the role of the Phallus-the master signifer of that Symbolic order-he or she could regain the full attention of the mother. However, this is impossible. In exchange for giving up this fantasy-which the Father demands of the child in the Oedipus complex-the infant gains his or her own relationship to the Phallus. The infant must break with the mother (nature, pre-symbolic) in order to become a subject (culture, symbolic order). One among many unique claims of Lacan's is that the infant acquires sexual difference in his or her relationship to the Phallus. According to Lacan, sexual difference is not about biological imperative (e.g. if you have a penis you are male, if you have a vagina you are female), it is about having one of two types of relationship to the Phallus-having or being the Phallus. Hence, in the Lacanian view, the body as humans understand it is something that is constructed in the mirror stage, and sexually differentiated in the entrance to the Symbolic order. Irigaray critically appropriates this radical description of sexual difference. She discusses the linguistic character of sexual difference in a manner similar to Lacan in This Sex Which Is Not One. Irigaray is more concerned with how culture-and language as a product of culture-understands sexual difference and subjectivity than with arguing that truths about sexual difference or subjectivity emerge out of biology itself. However she distances herself from Lacan in two key manners. First, Irigaray disagrees with Lacan's depiction of the Symbolic order as ahistorical and unchanging. Irigaray believes that language systems are malleable, and largely determined by power relationships that are in flux. Second, Irigaray remains unconvinced by Lacan's claims that the Phallus is an ahistorical master signifier of the Symbolic order that has no connection to male anatomy. In "Cosi Fan Tutti," she argues that the Phallus is not a purely symbolic category, but is ultimately an extension of-and reinforcement of-Freud's description of the world according to a one-sex model. According to Irigaray, the Phallus as the master signifier (that can be traced back to male anatomy) is evidence that the Symbolic order is constructed and not ahistorical.

b. Philosophy

Irigaray is also influenced by her extensive study of the history of philosophy. Texts such as Speculum of the Other Woman and An Ethics of Sexual Difference demonstrate her command of the philosophical canon. Speculum of the Other Woman discusses the elision of all things feminine in traditional thinkers such as Aristotle, Descartes, Kant, and Hegel. An Ethics of Sexual Difference also discusses the elision of the feminine, but specifically from the perspective of ethical relationships between men and women. An Ethics of Sexual Difference addresses thinkers as diverse as Plato, Merleau-Ponty, Spinoza, and Levinas. Irigaray is also writing a series of texts devoted to the four elements. The elemental works Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche and The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger are sustained discussions of the exclusions implemented by key male philosophers.

No one philosopher can be identified as influencing Irigaray. She appropriates from various thinkers while maintaining a critical distance. For example, her method of mimesis resembles Derridian deconstruction. However, she also criticizes Derrida's deconstruction of the category "woman" (see Derrida's Spurs) in Marine Lover. As another example, she agrees with Heidegger that every age has a concept that underlies and informs its beliefs, but is radically unknown to it. For Heidegger it was "Being," for Irigaray it is "sexual difference." Like Heidegger, she wants to investigate the concept that Western culture takes to be self-evident in order to show that it is unknown to us. However she is critical in The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger of Heidegger's exclusion of women. One can also find Levinasian (An Ethics of Sexual Difference), Hegelian (I love to you) or Marxist (This Sex Which Is Not One, "Women on the Market") undertones in Irigaray's discussions of ethics and dialectical thinking. While she is clearly influenced by the history of philosophy, her own project of creating a new space for redefining women does not permit her to privilege any one philosophical approach.

4. Major Themes

a. Mimesis

Irigaray describes herself as analyzing both the analysts and the philosophers. Perhaps the most famous critical tool employed by Irigaray is mimesis. Mimesis is a process of resubmitting women to stereotypical views of women in order to call the views themselves into question. Key to mimesis is that the stereotypical views are not repeated faithfully. One example is that if women are viewed as illogical, women should speak logically about this view. According to Irigaray, the juxtaposition of illogical and logical undermines the claim that women are illogical. Or if women's bodies are viewed as multiple and dispersed, women should speak from that position in a playful way that suggests that this view stems from a masculine economy that values identity and unity (e.g. the penis or the Phallus) and excludes women as the other (e.g. lack, dispersed, or "nothing to see"). This type of mimesis is also known as strategic essentialism. Irigaray's essay "This Sex Which Is Not One," in the text of the same name, provides several clear examples of this method.

According to Irigaray, the very possibility of repeating a negative view unfaithfully suggests that women are something other than the view expressed. Irigaray repeats the views because she believes that overcoming harmful views of women cannot occur through simply ignoring the views. True to the methodology of psychoanalysis, she believes that negative views can only be overcome when they are exposed and demystified. When successfully employed, mimesis repeats a negative view-without reducing women to that view-and makes fun of it such that the view itself must be discarded. Irigaray's wager in utilizing mimesis with regard to female subjectivity is as follows. Male dominance has defined Western culture for centuries. If a new form of subjectivity comes into being out of the death of the modern, transcendental subject, and we have never really investigated or mimetically engaged with the deformed, female form of subjectivity that accompanied and sustained the male form, then what would prevent the logic of master/subject/male and slave/other/female from repeating itself? According to Irigaray, the logic will not be altered until we call attention to the fact that subjectivity has changed before when male dominance has not. We must ask after the feminine other. Irigaray believes that only by asking after the other through mimesis will it be possible to affect a paradigm shift. Irigaray therefore speaks from the silenced position of women in order to (a) challenge the authority of either the negative view or the repression by revealing that position to be nothing more than a fabrication (b) show how the woman/body has been excluded by either revealing the stereotypical view to be false or by inciting the excluded woman/body to speak and (c) thereby force a shift in the conception of female subjectivity and the body. Irigaray employs mimesis because she believes that a 'second sex' cannot exist in its own right (or with a positive form of identity as opposed to being viewed as a deformed version of male identity) until we have not only challenged, but also passed back through the oppressive formulation of sexual difference in contemporary Western culture.

b. Novel Language and Utopian Ideals

While the goal of mimesis is to problematize the male definition of femininity to such a degree that a new definition of and, ultimately, an embodied subject position for women can emerge, Irigaray says in her earlier work that she will not prescribe in advance either the definition or the subject position. In This Sex Which Is Not One, Irigaray clearly indicates that she will not redefine femininity because it would interfere with women redefining themselves for themselves. Further, she believes that she cannot describe the feminine (e.g. female subjectivity, the female imaginary body) outside of the current, male definitions without further disrupting the male definitions of women. A new definition for women has to emerge out of a mimetic engagement with the old definitions, and it is a collective process.

Irigaray is, however, willing to provide material to help ignite the process of redefinition. The material she offers varies from new concepts about religion and bodies-expressed through both the novel use of existing words and the creation of new words-to utopian ideals. One example of a new concept that she puts into play through novel language is her discussion of the sensible/transcendental and female divinity. Irigaray introduces these concepts in order to disrupt male dominance in religion. Irigaray follows Feuerbach in interpreting the divine as an organizing principle for both identity and culture. Religion is thus viewed as caught up in power and culture. Irigaray specifically targets male dominated religions that posit a transcendental God. She believes that these religions reinforce male dominance and the division of the world into male/subject and female/body. She suggests that in place of a religion that focuses on a transcendent God, we construct a divinity that is both sensible and transcendental. In other words, given the connection between religion and culture, and the manner in which the mind/body split has fallen out along gender lines, why not propose a vision of divinity that will help Western culture overcome its dualisms and prejudices about those dualisms. Irigaray is not prescribing the sensible/transcendental as a new religion to be implemented and followed, but merely placing it in circulation as a creative impetus for change. An example of utopian ideals can be found in Sexes and Genealogies, thinking the difference, and je, tu, nous. In these texts, Irigaray describes civil laws that she believes would help women achieve social existence (mature subjectivity) in Western culture. In one law she suggests that virginity needs to be protected under the law so that women have control over their own sexuality. She also describes new ways in which the mother/daughter relationship should be legally protected, and outlines how mothers and daughters can communicate with each other so that female subjectivity can be further developed. When these texts were first published, these views were widely interpreted as suggestions intended to initiate discussions between women (utopian ideals) and not as prescriptions for social change. While Irigaray's later work has complicated this interpretation, it is still widely accepted.

c. Mother/Daughter Relationships

According to Irigaray, while it is necessary to alter cultural norms, it is equally as important to address the problematic nature of individual relationships between women-especially the mother/daughter relationship. To emphasize how mother/daughter relationships are sundered in contemporary Western culture, Irigaray turns to Greek mythology. For example, she discusses the myth of Demeter, the goddess of the earth (agriculture), and her daughter Persephone. In the myth, Zeus, Persephone's father, aids his brother Hades, king of the underworld, to abduct the young Perspephone. Hades has fallen in love with Persephone and wants her to be queen of the underworld. When Demeter learns that her daughter is missing, she is devastated and abandons her role as goddess of the earth. The earth becomes barren. To reestablish harmony in the world, Zeus needs Demeter to return to her divine responsibilities. Zeus orders Hades to return Persephone. However, Persephone is tricked into eating a pomegranate seed that binds her to Hades forever. Under the persuasion of Zeus, Hades agrees to release Persephone from the underworld for half of each year. Irigaray reads this myth as an example of both a positive mother/daughter relationship, and the success of men at breaking it apart. Demeter and Persephone love each other and Demeter strives to protect her daughter. However, in this myth they are ultimately at the mercy of the more powerful males. The myth is also an example of men exchanging women as if they were commodities. Zeus conspires with his brother and, in effect, gives his daughter away without consulting either Persephone or Demeter. Irigaray believes that myths tell us something about the deterioration of the mother/daughter relationship and the manner in which men have traditionally controlled the fate of women-whether they are wives, daughters, sisters, or mothers. Irigaray utilizes myth to suggest that mothers and daughters need to protect their relationships and strengthen their bonds to one another.

The need to alter the mother/daughter relationship is a constant theme in Irigaray's work. While she believes that women's social and political situation has to be addressed on a global level, she also thinks that change begins in individual relationships between women. Thus she stresses the need for mothers to represent themselves differently to their daughters, and to emphasize their daughter's subjectivity. For example, in je, tu, nous, Irigaray offers suggestions for developing mother-daughter relationships such as displaying images of the mother-daughter couple, or consciously emphasizing that the daughter and the mother are both subjects in their own right. Changing relationships between mothers and daughters also requires language work.

d. Language

Since Irigaray agrees with Lacan that one must enter language (culture) in order to be a subject, she believes that language itself must change if women are to have their own subjectivity that is recognized at a cultural level. She believes that language typically excludes women from an active subject position. Further, inclusion of women in the current form of subjectivity is not the solution. Irigaray's goal is for there to be more than one subject position in language.

In order to prove that language excludes women from subjectivity, Irigaray conducted research that links the exclusion of women from subjectivity in Western culture to the speech patterns of men and women. She concluded that general speech patterns specific to each sex do exist and that women often do not occupy the subject position in language. She argues that in language experiments, women were less willing to occupy the subject position. Referring to the French language as a clear example-even though she believes that the structure of the English language does not exempt it from sexism-she discusses the dominance of the masculine in both the plural and the neuter, which takes the same form as the masculine. Irigaray argues that objects of value, such as the sun or God, are typically marked with the masculine gender while less important objects are feminine. Since language and society mutually affect each other, Irigaray believes that language must change along with society. Failure to see the importance of changing language is an impediment to real change. According to Irigaray, it is crucial that women learn to occupy the position of "I" and "you" in language. Irigaray views the "I" and the "you" as markers of subjectivity. In her text I love to you, Irigaray describes how she determined that women do not occupy the subject position. She conducted an experiment where she gave her subjects a noun (e.g. enfant) and asked her test subjects to use the noun in a sentence as a pronoun (il or elle). The majority of both men and women consistently chose "il". She noted in another experiment, where she gave a sequence that implied the use of "elle" (e.g. robe-se-voir), that both sexes avoided using "elle" (she) and "elle se" (she herself) as an active subject. In contrast, when she gave a sequence that implied the use of il as a subject, it was almost always used. Further, Irigaray discovered that young girls seek an intersubjective dialogue with their mothers, but that their mothers did not reciprocate. Irigaray concludes from her research that women are not subjects in language in the same way as men. She believes that men and women do not produce the same sentences with similar cues, they use prepositions differently, and they represent temporality in language differently. Irigaray seeks for men and women to recognize each other in language as irreducible others. She argues that this cannot happen until women occupy the subject position, and men learn to communicate with other subjects. Irigaray believes that a language of 'indirection' could help bring this to fruition. She describes this in her book I love to you. The title itself is an example of this language of indirection. Saying "I love to you" rather than "I love you" is a way of symbolizing a respect for the other. The "to" is a verbal barrier against appropriating or subjugating the other. Speaking differently in this manner is an integral part of Irigaray's general project to cultivate true intersubjectivity between the genders. However, she does not put forth a definitive plan for implementing this change in language.

e. Ethics

While ethics is a constant theme throughout her work, Irigaray's text An Ethics of Sexual Difference is devoted to this theme. In this text, Irigaray intertwines essays of her own on the ethics of sexual difference with dialogues that she has created between herself and six male philosophers: Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Spinoza, Merleau-Ponty and Levinas. Irigaray groups the dialogues into four sections that each begin with an essay of her own about sexual difference and love. Her own essay signals what themes she will address with regard to each of the philosophers she discusses. Irigaray utilizes her analyses of the male philosophers to discuss the following themes which are essential to her ethics: creative relationships between men and women that are not based in reproduction, separate 'places' for men and women (emotional and embodied), wonder at the difference of the other, acknowledgement of finiteness and intersubjectivity, and an embodied divinity.

In the first section, which engages Plato and Aristotle, Irigaray emphasizes that an ethical love relationship must be creative independent of procreation, and that both men and women need to have a place for themselves (be embodied individuals) that is open to, but not subsumable by, the other. In the second section, using Descartes and Spinoza, she argues that ethical love cannot occur between men and women until there is respect and wonder for the irreducible difference of the other, and an admittance and acceptance of one's finiteness. In the third section, in which there is no engagement with a male philosopher, Irigaray describes how the infinite is essential to love between men and women. She believes that it is unethical that women have not had access to subjectivity, and that the universals of our culture have been dominated by a male imaginary. She says that ethics requires that men and women understand themselves as embodied subjects. In the fourth and final section, Irigaray discusses Merleau-Ponty and Levinas. She argues that if ethical relationships are to occur between men and women, men must overcome nostalgia for the womb. Thus will they develop their identity, and open up a space for women to create their own. Further, Irigaray believes that we must think both otherness and divinity in conjunction with embodiment. She believes that separating mind and body is unethical insofar as it perpetuates the division in culture between man/mind and woman/body. Ethics involves thinking of otherness and divinity in terms of the sensible/transcendental. At the end of her An Ethics of Sexual Difference, it is clear that Irigaray does not believe that Western culture is ethical, and that the primary reason is its treatment of women and nature. She believes that nothing short of altering our views of subjectivity, science, and religion can change this situation. Men and women must work together to learn to respect the irreducible difference between them. Women must become full subjects, and men must recognize that they are embodied. Further, ethical love relationships are based in respect for alterity and creativity outside of reproduction. Her text I love to you, which focuses on both language and ethics, is a clear example of how her discussion of ethics can also be developed from a Hegelian perspective.

f. Politics

Irigaray refuses to belong to any one group in the feminist movement because she believes that there is a tendency for groups to set themselves up against each other. When groups within the women's movement fight each other, this detracts from the overall goal of trying to positively alter the social, political, and symbolic position of women. Irigaray models solidarity among women in her unwillingness to belong exclusively to one group.

Irigaray is particularly active in the feminist movement in Italy. Texts such as I love to you, Democracy Begins Between Two, and Two Be Two were all inspired by and, at various moments, give accounts of Irigaray's experience with the Italian women's movement. An example of Irigaray's most recent collaborations with Italy, and a testimony to her commitment to her ideas, is her collaboration with the Commission for Equal Opportunities for the region of Emilia-Romagna. She was invited by this region to educate its citizens about her political ideals. Her text, Democracy Begins Between Two, was a part of that collaboration insofar as it was the theoretical work behind her role as adviser. In that text she also describes how she and Renzo Imbeni co-authored a "Report on Citizenship of the Union." This report argued for rights based on sexual difference and was submitted to the European Parliament for ratification.

5. Criticisms

a. Strategic Essentialism

Irigaray's use of strategic essentialism has been criticized as essentialism itself-or of endorsing the belief that social behavior follows from biology. The appearance of her translated work in the United States was met with great opposition. She was read as further naturalizing women at a time when women were benefiting both politically and socially from arguing that biology did not matter. Irigaray and her supporters defended her engagement with essentialist views as a strategy. They argued that when Irigaray seeks to alter the exclusion of the feminine by repeating or reiterating naturalizing discourses about female bodies, she is not suggesting a return to a lost female body that pre-exists patriarchy. Rather, she is employing her strategy of mimesis. While many contemporary interpreters now accept this view, strategic essentialism remains a controversial aspect of Irigaray's work.

b. Privileges Psychological Oppression

Irigaray has been criticized-especially by materialist feminists-on the grounds that she privileges questions of psychological oppression over social/material oppression. The concern is that the psychoanalytic discourse that Irigaray relies upon-even though she is critical of it-universalizes and abstracts away from material conditions that are of central concern to feminism. Materialist feminists do not believe that definitive changes in the structure of politics can result from the changes Irigaray proposes in psychoanalytic theories of subject formation. However, Irigaray's goal to challenge psychoanalytic theory and to change the definition of femininity evinces an agreement with the materialist position. Both agree that the ahistorical, overly universalized character of traditional psychoanalytic theory must be rejected. Further, Irigaray argues that focusing on language work and on altering allegedly intractable structures does not mean that women have to ignore material conditions. In This Sex Which Is Not One, Irigaray says that simultaneous with her challenges to the symbolic order, women must fight for equal wages, and against discrimination in employment and education. Irigaray recognizes that it is important to find ways to challenge the social and economic position in which women find themselves. But focusing exclusively on women's material or economic situation as the key to change will only-at best-grant women access to a male social role insofar as it will not change the definition of women. Irigaray's response to first changing material conditions would be that it would leave the question of a non-patriarchal view of female identity untouched. Due to the force of the oppression of women, it is the definitions that have to be changed before women, as distinct from men, will attain a social existence.

c. Elides Differences

Related to the materialist critique is the question of whether or not Irigaray's psychoanalytic approach can account for real differences between women. Irigaray often discusses a subject position for women and a new definition of women. A common question asked of Irigaray is whether or not a universal definition for women is desirable considering the real differences between women. More specifically, if Irigaray insists on a universal subject position for women, will it be exclusively determined by first world, white, middle class women? Can her universal successfully include the experiences of minority women, second and third world women, and economically disadvantaged women? Or does it create further exclusion among the excluded themselves? Irigaray's interpreters remain divided on this question.

d. Opaque Writing Style

Irigaray is often criticized along with other French feminists, such as Julia Kristeva, for the opacity of her writing style. Based on her writing style, she has been dismissed as elitist. Irigaray's writing is undeniably challenging and complex. But, the difficulty of her work can be equally productive as it is labor intensive. Irigaray's opacity can be viewed as fruitful when understood in conjunction with one mode of writing that she assumes-that of an analyst. In this style of writing, Irigaray not only will not assume the position of a master-knower who imparts knowledge in a linear manner, she also considers her readers' reactions to her work to be an integral part of that work. Her alleged failure to be clear, or to give a concrete, linear feminist theory, are invitations for readers to imagine their own vision for the future. Like the psychoanalytic session, her texts are a collaboration between writer (analyst) and reader (analysand). Irigaray believes that, through writing in this style, she can take culture as a whole as her analysand.

e. Exclusive Ethics

Irigaray's view of ethics is criticized because she describes the quintessential ethical relationship using a man and a woman. The question arises of whether or not Irigaray is suggesting that the heterosexual couple is the model for ethical relationships. Since it is unclear whether or not Irigaray's view can be applied to other types of relationships (e.g. same sex friendships or same sex love relationships), this point of criticism remains unresolved. Related to this critique is a concern that Irigaray's emphasis on sexual difference and male/female relationships also prevent her from accounting for non-traditional family arrangements.

f. Later Work

Irigaray's most recent work raises the final point of controversy. In her earlier work, Irigaray refuses to give a new definition of women because she thinks that women must give it to themselves. However, in her most recent work she has developed laws that she submitted to the European Parliament for ratification. Irigaray's interpreters debate about the relationship between her early work and her most recent texts. Is there continuity between the early and the later position? Or has Irigaray abandoned her earlier project? A spectrum of interpretations are available with no final answer.

6. References and Further Reading

a. English Translations

  • Irigaray, Luce. An Ethics of Sexual Difference. Trans. Carolyn Burke and Gillian C. Gill. Ithaca: Cornell UP, 1993.
    • Mimetic engagement with Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Spinoza, Merleau-Ponty, and Levinas on the question of ethics. Irigaray elaborates here her own vision for ethical relationships.
  • Between East and West: From Singularity to Community. Trans. Stephen Pluhácek. New York: Columbia UP, 2002.
    • Draws on Eastern philosophy and meditative techniques such as yoga to suggest new approaches to the question of sexual difference.
  • Democracy Begins Between Two. Trans. Kirsteen Anderson. New York: Routledge, 2000.
    • Inspired by a partnership with the Commission for Equal Opportunities for the region of Emilia-Romagna in Italy, this text describes civil rights for women that would grant them an equal social position to men. This text also includes the Report on Citizenship of the Union by Renzo Imbeni. This report was written in collaboration with Irigaray and submitted to the European Parliament for ratification.
  • Elemental Passions. Trans. Joanne Collie and Judith Still. New York: Routledge, 1992.
    • One text in Irigaray's series of elemental works. Addresses the relationship between men and women within the context of the elements and the senses.
  • je, tu, nous: towards a culture of difference. Trans. Alison Martin. New York: Routledge, 1993.
    • A series of essays that address diverse issues such as civil rights for women and prejudices in biology about the mother-fetus relationship.
  • I love to you: sketch of a possible felicity in history. Trans. Alison Martin. New York: Routledge, 1996.
    • Strategic engagement with Hegel in which Irigaray appropriates his use of dialectic in order to describe how men and women are both individuals and members of their gender. Also includes an extensive discussion of the language of indirection that Irigaray believes facilitates ethical relationships between men and women.
  • The Irigaray Reader. Ed. Margaret Whitford. Cambridge: Blackwell, 1991.
    • Useful compilation of essays, some of which are found in the texts listed here.
  • Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche. Trans. Gillian C. Gill. New York: Columbia University Press, 1991.
    • One text in Irigaray's elemental series, this text is a strategic engagement with Nietzsche and Derrida on the elision of femininity.
  • Sexes and Genealogies. Trans. Gillian C. Gill. New York: Columbia University Press, 1993.
    • Compilation of essays that address themes as diverse as how to alter the psychoanalytic session to descriptions of the sensible/transcendental.
  • Speculum of the Other Woman. Trans. Gillian C. Gill. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1985.
    • Irigaray's doctoral dissertation. This text is a complex engagement with the history of philosophy and psychoanalytic theory.
  • The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger. Trans. Mary Beth Mader. Austin: University of Texas Press, 1999.
    • One text in Irigaray's elemental series. This text is a strategic engagement with the philosopher Martin Heidegger.
  • Thinking the Difference: For a Peaceful Revolution. Trans. Karin Montin. New York: Routledge, 1994.
    • Compilation of essays on diverse themes. Similar in structure to je, tu, nous.
  • This Sex Which Is Not One. Trans. Catherine Porter. New York: Cornell University Press, 1985.
    • Compilation of essays that discuss themes as diverse as where Lacanian theory went wrong, what mimesis is, and how to give a Marxist critique of the exchange of women in Western culture.
  • To Be Two. Trans. Monique M. Rhodes and Marco F. Cocito-Monoc. New York: Routledge, 2001.
    • Later work. Further exploration of the question of difference and alterity.
  • To Speak Is Never Neutral. New York: Routledge, 2000.
    • Sustained discussion of language. Studying the language of both mentally ill and normal subjects, Irigaray argues that language is never deployed in a completely neutral manner.
  • Why Different?. Trans. Camille Collins. Ed. Luce Irigaray and Sylvere Lotinger. New York: Semiotext(e) Foreign Agent Series, 2000.
    • A compilation of interviews with Irigaray about select work written in the 80's and 90's such as Sexes and Genealogies and Language is Never Neutral.

b. Suggested Further Reading

  • Chanter, Tina. Ethics of Eros: Irigaray's Re-Writing of the Philosophers. New York: Routledge, 1995.
    • Thoroughly discusses philosophical influences on Irigaray's work. Argues that comprehending the philosophical influences on Irigaray highlights her innovative ideas about the now passe sex/gender distinction.
  • Cheah, Pheng and Elizabeth Grosz. "The Future of Sexual Difference: An Interview with Judith Butler and Drucilla Cornell." Diacritics, no. 28.1 (1998): 19-41.
    • Highlights central disagreements between prominent feminist thinkers about Irigaray's work.
  • Freud, Sigmund. Standard Edition of the Complete Psychological Works of Sigmund Freud. Trans. James Strachey in collaboration with Anna Freud. 24 vols. London: Hogarth Press and the Institute of Psychoanalysis, 1953-1974.
  • Freud, Sigmund. The Freud Reader. Ed. Peter Gay. NewYork: W.W. Norton & Co., 1989.
    • Accessible compilation of Freud's work. Of particular interest are "The Ego and the Id," "Femininity," "Mourning and Melancholia," and "Three Essays On The Theory of Sexuality." For unabridged versions of texts, consult the standard edition listed above.
  • Fuss, Diana. Essentially Speaking: Feminism, Nature and Difference. New York: Routledge, 1989.
    • Interesting discussion of strategic essentialism. Includes a discussion of Irigaray, pp. 55-72.
  • Gatens, Moira. Imaginary Bodies: Ethics, Power, and Corporeality. New York: Routledge, 1996.
    • Useful discussion of how the imaginary body plays out at a cultural level.
  • Grosz, Elizabeth. Volatile Bodies: Towards a Corporeal Feminism. Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1994.
    • A central text in philosophy of the body and the overcoming of dualisms.
  • Lacan, Jacques. Ecrits. Trans. Alan Sheridan. New York: W.W. Nortion & Co., 1977.
    • An accessible compilation of key essays in Lacanian thought.
  • Feminine Sexuality. Ed. Mitchell, Juliet and Jacqueline Rose. Trans. Jaqueline Rose. New York: W.W. Norton & Co., 1985.
    • An accessible compilation of key essays by Lacan on feminine sexuality.
  • Lorraine, Tamsin. Irigaray and Deleuze: Experiments in Visceral Philosophy. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999.
    • Very clear description of difficult aspects of Irigaray's thought. Interesting thesis about connections with Deleuze and Guatarri.
  • Schor, Naomi. "This Essentialism Which is Not One." Ed. Burke, Carolyn, Naomi Schor, and Margaret Whitford. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
    • Very famous and useful discussion of the different kinds of essentialism.
  • Whitford, Margaret. Luce Irigaray: Philosophy in the Feminine. New York: Routledge, 1991.
    • Whitford writes about the psychoanalytic influence on Irigaray's work. Whitford fleshes out Irigaray's appropriation of key psychoanalytic themes and clearly explains complex aspects of Irigaray's work.

Author Information

Sarah K. Donovan
Email: Sarah.Donovan@villanova.edu
Villanova University
U. S. A.

Søren Kierkegaard (1813—1855)

KierkegaardSøren Kierkegaard is an outsider in the history of philosophy. His peculiar authorship comprises a baffling array of different narrative points of view and disciplinary subject matter, including aesthetic novels, works of psychology and Christian dogmatics, satirical prefaces, philosophical "scraps" and "postscripts," literary reviews, edifying discourses, Christian polemics, and retrospective self-interpretations. His arsenal of rhetoric includes irony, satire, parody, humor, polemic and a dialectical method of "indirect communication" - all designed to deepen the reader’s subjective passionate engagement with ultimate existential issues. Like his role models Socrates and Christ, Kierkegaard takes how one lives one’s life to be the prime criterion of being in the truth. Kierkegaard’s closest literary and philosophical models are Plato, J.G. Hamann, G.E. Lessing, and his teacher of philosophy at the University of Copenhagen Poul Martin Møller, although Goethe, the German Romantics, Hegel, Kant and the logic of Adolf Trendelenburg are also important influences. His prime theological influence is Martin Luther, although his reactions to his Danish contemporaries N.F.S. Grundtvig and H.L. Martensen are also crucial. In addition to being dubbed "the father of existentialism," Kierkegaard is best known as a trenchant critic of Hegel and Hegelianism and for his invention or elaboration of a host of philosophical, psychological, literary and theological categories, including: anxiety, despair, melancholy, repetition, inwardness, irony, existential stages, inherited sin, teleological suspension of the ethical, Christian paradox, the absurd, reduplication, universal/exception, sacrifice, love as a duty, seduction, the demonic, and indirect communication.

Table of Contents

  1. Life (1813-55)
    1. Father and Son: Inherited Melancholy
    2. Regina Olsen: The Sacrifice of Love
    3. The Master of Irony and the Seductions of Writing
    4. The "Authorship": From Melancholy to Humor
    5. The "Second Authorship": Self-Sacrifice, Love, Despair, and the God-Man
    6. The Attack on the Danish People's Church
  2. The "Aesthetic Authorship"
    1. On the Concept of Irony and Either/Or
    2. Fear and Trembling and Repetition
    3. Philosophical Fragments, The Concept of Anxiety, and Prefaces
    4. Stages on Life’s Way and Concluding Unscientific Postscript
  3. The Edifying Discourses
    1. Sermons, Deliberations, and Edifying Discourses
    2. Direct and Indirect Communication
    3. That Single Individual, My Reader
  4. The "Second Authorship"
    1. Works of Love
    2. Anti-Climacus
    3. The Attack on the Church
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life (1813-55)

a. Father and Son: Inherited Melancholy

Søren Aabye Kierkegaard was born on May 5th 1813 in Copenhagen. He was the seventh and last child of wealthy hosier, Michael Pedersen Kierkegaard and Ane Sørensdatter Lund, a former household servant and distant cousin of Michael Kierkegaard. This was Michael Kierkegaard's second marriage, which came within a year of his first wife’s death and four months into Ane Lund’s first pregnancy. Michael Kierkegaard was a deeply melancholic man, sternly religious and carried a heavy burden of guilt, which he imposed on his children. Søren Kierkegaard often lamented that he had never had a childhood of carefree spontaneity, but that he had been "born old." As a starving shepherd boy on the Jutland heath Michael had cursed God. His surname derived from the fact that his family was indentured to the parish priest, who provided a piece of the church (Kirke) farm (Gaard) for the family’s use. The name Kirkegaard (in older spelling Kierkegaard) more commonly means 'churchyard’ or ‘cemetery.’ A sense of doom and death seemed to hover over Michael Kierkegaard for most of his 82 years. Although his material fortunes soon turned around dramatically, he was convinced that he had brought a curse on his family and that all his children were doomed to die by the age attained by Jesus Christ (33). Of Michael’s seven children, only Peter Christian and Søren Aabye survived beyond this age.

At age 12 Michael Kierkegaard was summoned to Copenhagen to work for his uncle as a journeyman in the cloth trade. Michael turned out to be an astute businessman and by the age of 24 had his own flourishing business. He subsequently inherited his uncle's fortune, and augmented his wealth by some felicitous investments during the state bankruptcy of 1813 (the year, as Søren later put it, in which so many bad notes were put into circulation). Michael retired young and devoted himself to the study of theology, philosophy and literature. He bequeathed to his surviving sons Peter and Søren not only material wealth, but also supremely sharp intellect, a fathomless sense of guilt, and a relentless burden of melancholy. Although his father was wealthy, Søren was brought up rather stringently. He stood out at school because of his plain, unfashionable apparel and spindly stature. He learned to avoid teasing only by honing a caustic wit and a canny appreciation of other people's psychological weaknesses. He was sent to one of Copenhagen’s best schools, The School of Civic Virtue [Borgerdydskolen], to receive a classical education. More than twice as much time was devoted to Latin in this school than to any other subject. Søren distinguished himself academically at school, especially in Latin and history, though according to his classmates he struggled with Danish composition. This became a real problem later, when he tried desperately to break into the Danish literary scene as a writer. His early publications were characterized by complex Germanic constructions and excessive use of Latin phrases. But eventually he became a master of his mother tongue, one of the two great stylists of Danish in his time, together with Hans Christian Andersen. Kierkegaard's father is a constant presence in his authorship. He appears in stories of sacrifice, of inherited melancholy and guilt, as the archetypal patriarch, and even in explicit dedications at the beginning of several edifying discourses. Kierkegaard’s mother, on the other hand, never gets a mention in any of the writings - not even in his journal on the day of her death. His mother-tongue, though, is omnipresent. If we conjoin this fact with the remark in Concluding Unscientific Postscript (1846) that "... an omnipresent person should be recognizable precisely by being invisible," we could speculate that the mother is even more present than the father, pervading all but the foreign language insertions in the texts. But whether or not there is any substance in this speculation, the invisibility of the mother and the treatment of women in general are indicative of Kierkegaard’s uneasy relationship with the opposite sex.

b. Regina Olsen: The Sacrifice of Love

Søren drifted into the study of theology at the University of Copenhagen, but soon broadened his study to include philosophy and literature. He started rather desultorily, and enjoyed a relatively dissolute time, even aspiring to cut the figure of a dandy. He ran up debts, which his father reluctantly paid, but eventually knuckled down to finish his degree when his father died in 1838. It seemed he was destined for a life as a pastor in the Danish People's Church. In 1840, just before he enrolled at the Pastoral Seminary, he became engaged to Regina Olsen. This engagement was to form the basis of a great literary love story, propagated by Kierkegaard through his published writings and his journals. It also provided an occasion for Kierkegaard to define himself further as an outsider. For several years (at least since 1835) Kierkegaard had been dabbling with the idea of becoming a writer. The wealth he had inherited from his father enabled him to support himself comfortably without the need to work for a living. But it was not really enough to support a wife, let alone a wife and children. Furthermore, Kierkegaard harbored an undisclosed secret, something dark and personal, which he thought it his duty to confide to a wife, but which he dared not. Whether it was some sexual indiscretion, an inherited sexual disease, his innate melancholy, an egotistical mania to become a writer, or something else, we can only speculate. But when it came to the crunch, it seemed sufficient to make him break off the engagement rather than to reveal it to Regina. Thereafter, Kierkegaard frequently used marriage as a trope for "the universal" - especially for the universal demands made by social mores. Correlatively, becoming an "exception" was both a task and constantly in need of justification. The tortuous dialectic of universal and exception, worked out in terms of the sacrifices of love, subsequently informs much of Either/Or, Repetition, Fear and Trembling, Prefaces, and Stages on Life’s Way. A frequent foil for the trope of marriage as the universal is the figure of a young man "poeticized" by a broken engagement, who thereby becomes "an exception." Only when the young man is "poeticized" in the direction of the religious, however, is there any question of his being a "justified exception." Kierkegaard’s ultimate justification for breaking off his own engagement was his dedication to a life of writing as a religious poet, under the direction of divine Governance. As a measure of the importance the relationship to Regina had for his life, Kierkegaard adapted a line from Virgil’s Aeneid II,3 as "a motto for part of his life’s suffering": Infandum me jubes Regina renovare dolorem ("Queen [Regina], the sorrow you bid me revive is unspeakable").

c. The Master of Irony and the Seductions of Writing

During the period of his engagement Kierkegaard was also busy writing his Master's dissertation in philosophy, On the Concept of Irony: with constant reference to Socrates (1841). This was later automatically converted to a doctorate (1854). Kierkegaard had petitioned the king to write his dissertation in Danish - only the third such request to be granted. Usually academic dissertations had to be written and defended in Latin. Kierkegaard was allowed to write his dissertation in Danish, but had to condense it into a series of theses in Latin, to be defended publicly in Latin, before the degree would be awarded. Almost immediately after his dissertation defense, Kierkegaard broke off his engagement to Regina. He then undertook the first of four journeys to Berlin - his only trips abroad apart from a brief trip to Sweden. During this first trip to Berlin Kierkegaard completed most of the first volume of Either/Or (much of the second volume already having been completed).

Throughout the second half of the 1830s Kierkegaard had aspired to become part of the pre-eminent literary set in Copenhagen. This centered on Professor J.L. Heiberg, playwright, philosopher, aesthetician, journal publisher, and doyen of Copenhagen's literati. Heiberg had been credited with introducing Hegel’s philosophy to Denmark, though in fact there had already been lectures on Hegel by the Norwegian philosopher Henrik Steffens among others. Nevertheless, the fact that Heiberg gave Hegel’s work his imprimatur accelerated its acceptance into mainstream Danish intellectual life. By the end of the 1830s Hegelianism dominated Copenhagen’s philosophy, theology and aesthetics. Of course this engendered some resistance, including that from Kierkegaard’s professors of philosophy F.C. Sibbern and Poul Martin Møller. One of Hegelianism’s most illustrious local exponents was Kierkegaard’s archrival H.L. Martensen (professor of theology at Copenhagen University, later Bishop Primate of the Danish People’s Church). Martensen, just five years senior to Kierkegaard, was firmly entrenched in the Heiberg literary set, and anticipated at least one of Kierkegaard’s pet literary projects - an analysis of the figure of Faust. In his journals, as part of his practice at becoming a writer, Kierkegaard had been fascinated with three great literary figures from the Middle Ages, who he thought embodied the full range of modern aesthetic types. These figures were Don Juan, Faust, and the Wandering Jew. They embodied sensuality, doubt and despair respectively. Martensen’s publication on Faust pre-empted Kierkegaard’s budding literary project, though the latter eventually found expression in the first volume of Either/Or (1843). Meanwhile, Kierkegaard continued to seek Heiberg's seal of approval. His first major breakthrough was an address to the University of Copenhagen’s Student Association on the issue of freedom of the press. This was a satirical conservative riposte to a previous address in favor of more liberal press laws, and was the first broadside by Kierkegaard in a long career of lambasting the popular press, especially insofar as it supported political agitation for democracy. In this instance, however, it seemed motivated more by a desire to showcase his wit and erudition than by any deeper engagement with the political issues. The freedom of the press had been severely undermined by King Frederik VI’s ordinance of 1799, and was threatened with full censorship by his press legislation of 1834. The Society for the Proper Use of Press Freedom was formed in 1835 to combat this development. Kierkegaard followed up his speech with an article in Heiberg’s paper, The Copenhagen Flying Post (1836). The article, published pseudonymously, was so clever and polished that some people mistook it for the work of Heiberg himself. This amounted to his calling card for invitation to the Heiberg literary salon. Kierkegaard followed this with further pseudonymous articles on the same topic. But his first monograph was a 70-page review of Hans Christian Andersen's novel, Only a Fiddler. This too was a strategic move to break into the inner sanctum of Heiberg’s circle. Andersen was emerging as a major talent in Danish letters, having published poetry, plays and two novels, which had almost immediately been translated into German. Only a Fiddler was on a topic dear to Kierkegaard’s heart - genius. Andersen’s prime claim was that genius needs nurturing, and can succumb to circumstance and disappear without trace. Kierkegaard, in his book-length review From the Papers of One Still Living (1838), disagreed stridently, maintaining that the spark of genius could never be extinguished, but only augmented by adversity. Furthermore, he developed a theory of the novel in which he asserted that to be worth its salt, a novel had to be informed by a "life-view" and a "life-development." He criticized Andersen’s novel for its dependence on contingent features from Andersen’s own life, rather than being transfigured by a mature philosophy of life with clarity of purpose. He contrasted Andersen’s novel unfavorably in this respect with the novel by Heiberg’s mother, Thomasine Gyllembourg, A Story of Everyday Life. Kierkegaard was to return to Gyllembourg as a novelist in his review of her Two Ages in A Literary Review (1846). He was also to write a review of the work of Heiberg’s wife Louise, Denmark’s leading actress, in The Crisis and A Crisis in the Life of an Actress (1848).

d. The "Authorship": From Melancholy to Humor

Neither the articles in Heiberg's papers, nor the monograph on Andersen as novelist had gained Kierkegaard secure membership of Heiberg’s circle - though he was an occasional visitor there. With the breaking of his engagement to Regina, the completion of a major academic book (The Concept of Irony), his decision to devote himself to writing, and the trip to Berlin both to audit Schelling’s lectures (along with Karl Marx, Jacob Burckhardt and other luminaries) and to concentrate on his new literary project (Either/Or), Kierkegaard was about to embark on what he later, retrospectively, called his "authorship." This was eventually to comprise all the "aesthetic" pseudonymous works from Victor Eremita’s Either/Or to Johannes Climacus’s Concluding Unscientific Postscript, the Edifying Discourses under Kierkegaard’s own name (up to 1846), and Two Ages: The Age of Revolution and the Present Age: A Literary Review (by S. Kierkegaard). In short, these were the works published between Kierkegaard’s first and final visits to Berlin.

Either/Or burst upon the Copenhagen reading public with great force. It was immediately understood to be a major literary event. It was also regarded as scandalous by some, since its first volume portrayed the cynical, bored aestheticism of the modern flâneur, culminating in "The Seducer's Diary." Many, including Heiberg, took this to be a thinly disguised account of Kierkegaard’s own treatment of Regina Olsen. Most of the reviews, including Heiberg’s, concentrated on the scurrilous content of the first volume of the book. But other reviews read the two-volume work as a whole, and discovered the edifying and ethical framework in which the aesthetic point of view was to be assessed. Nevertheless, Heiberg’s review deeply offended Kierkegaard, and marked the point at which his relationship to Heiberg changed from aspiring associate to embittered critic. Hereafter in the "authorship" Heiberg became the target of unrelenting satire. He and Martensen were the main representatives of Danish Hegelianism, which is attacked at various points in the "authorship" - particularly in Prefaces (1844) and in Concluding Unscientific Postscript. It is worth noting that Hegel himself comes in for much less criticism, and much more positive endorsement, in Kierkegaard’s work than is commonly assumed. It is the Christian Hegelianism of Danish intellectuals that is the main target of his critiques. The "authorship" comprises two parallel series of texts. On the one hand are the pseudonymous works, which purportedly follow a dialectical trajectory of existential "stages" from the aesthetic, through the ethical, to the religious, and ultimately to the paradoxical religious stage of Christian faith. On the other hand are the Edifying Discourses, which are published under Kierkegaard's own name, which resemble sermons on biblical texts, and which are addressed to a readership already presumed to be Christian. The pseudonymous authorship starts with an existential type modeled on the German Romantic aesthete - the ironic, urbane flâneur whose main concern is to avoid boredom and to maintain a cerebral spectator’s interest in life and its sensuous pleasures. Ironically, this aesthete is beset with melancholy. His greatest happiness is his unhappiness, as the section of Either/Or entitled "The Unhappiest One" concludes. Although boredom is stated to be the negative motivation for the aesthete’s actions, at a deeper level we can discern that it is escape from melancholy and despair that are the real motivators. As part of the dialectical framework of the "authorship," Kierkegaard says there are also intermediate states between the discrete existential stages. These he calls "confinia" or border areas. Between the aesthetic and ethical stages lies the confinium of irony. Between the ethical and religious stages lies the confinium of humor. Humor is defined as "irony to a higher power" - so it does not wear its meaning on its sleeve. It is also to be understood as an inclusive, magnanimous state of affirming "both/and" (both the aesthetic and the ethical, both the tragic and the comic) rather than the ethically exclusive "either/or." The author of Concluding Unscientific Postscript, Johannes Climacus is a self-professed "humorist" in this sense. Although he purports to give the reader the truth about Christianity, he also "revokes" all he has said in that book. The religious humorist purports to go beyond the aesthetic and the ethical by choosing the religious exclusively, yet by virtue of the absurd, gets the aesthetic and the ethical back again within the religious. In terms of his own psychological economy, Kierkegaard seems to have been struggling to lose his melancholy and have it at the same time. It seems to have served him as an essential motor of aesthetic productivity, but was also a constant source of suffering from which he sought escape. For a long time Kierkegaard reconciled himself to his life of aesthetic self-indulgence as an author with the idea that it was all for a limited time. Once his "authorship' was complete, he would retire from writing and become a country pastor ministering to the souls of simple folk. Authorship was both a demonic temptation and a means of self-justification as an exception to the universal demands of society’s ethics. But just as he was on the point of completing the "authorship," Kierkegaard managed to provoke an attack on himself by the press, which demanded further work as an author in response.

e. The "Second Authorship": Self-Sacrifice, Love, Despair, and the God-Man

Kierkegaard provoked an attack on himself by the journal The Corsair. The journal, edited by the talented Jewish author Meïr Goldschmidt, specialized in ruthless satirical attacks on contemporary Danish authors. Yet, perhaps because of the esteem in which Goldschmidt held him, Kierkegaard had been spared. Kierkegaard found this favorable treatment offensive (partly out of vanity, ostensibly because of his ongoing critique of the press's influence on public opinion). So he publicly challenged The Corsair to do its worst. It did. It launched a series of attacks on Kierkegaard, more personal than literary, and focused on his odd appearance and his relationship with Regina. In some wicked caricatures it portrayed him with one trouser leg shorter than the other, with a sway back, and riding on a woman’s (Regina’s) back with stick in hand. These caricatures made a laughing stock of Kierkegaard in Copenhagen, to the extent that he was mocked in the street and had to give up his habit of walking around the inner city to talk with all and sundry.

But it galvanized him to begin a "second authorship." This time the edifying discourses under his own name were supplemented with works by the pseudonym Anti-Climacus. Anti-Climacus represents an idealized Christian point of view - one that Kierkegaard professed is higher than he had been able to achieve in his own life. The only other pseudonyms to appear in this "second authorship" were Inter et Inter, author of The Crisis and A Crisis in the Life of an Actress, and "H.H." author of "Two Ethical-Religious Essays." In addition the "second authorship" comprises: Works of Love (1847), The Sickness Unto Death (1849), Practice in Christianity (1850), as well as various edifying discourses, including Edifying Discourses in Various Spirits (1847), The Lily of the Field and the Bird of the Air (1849), Three Discourses at the Communion on Fridays (1849), Two Discourses at the Communion on Fridays (1851), and For Self-Examination (1851). He also published a retrospective self-interpretation of his writings to date, On My Work as an Author (under his own name - 1851). In addition Kierkegaard wrote various works at this time which he decided not to publish. The most significant of these are: The Book on Adler and The Point of View for My Work as an Author. The former gives a detailed analysis of the "phenomenon" of Adolph Adler, a pastor in the Danish People's Church who claimed to have had a divine revelation. He was deemed mad by the church authorities and pensioned off. Adler had been a leading Hegelian in the 1840s, but on Kierkegaard’s analysis ends up being "a Satire on Hegelian Philosophy and the Present Age." Kierkegaard makes an immanent critique of Adler’s writings to demonstrate their confusion and the absence of revelation. Kierkegaard published only the addendum to The Book on Adler as "The Difference between a Genius and an Apostle" in "Two Ethical Religious Essays." The Point of View for My Work as an Author sets out Kierkegaard’s (retrospective) interpretation of his authorship. It is subtitled: "A Direct Communication, Report to History." It explains in direct terms the dialectic of indirect communication, but Kierkegaard was uncertain whether its directness at that time was dialectically correct for the authorship and refrained from publishing it. The "second authorship" reintroduces various concepts from the "aesthetic authorship," but "transfigured" by the light of Christian faith. One of the most significant of these is "despair," which is a transfigured version of "anxiety." Both concepts are illuminated by reference to the notion of sin, and both are constitutive of the dialectic of selfhood. Only by acknowledging our ultimate dependence on God's grace is it possible to overcome despair, and to become a self (paradoxically by becoming as "nothing" before God). Another concept transfigured in the "second authorship" is "love." In the "aesthetic authorship" "love" is understood in pagan terms, primarily as eros - or desire. Desire is preferential, based on a lack (we only desire what we don’t have, according to Plato’s Symposium), and is ultimately selfish. Christian love is understood as agape. It is self-sacrificing, directed to the neighbor (without personal preference), is conceived as a spiritual duty rather than a psychological feeling, and comes as a gift from God rather than from the attraction between human beings. Its only perfect model is in the person of Jesus Christ, the God-man. We can see in the journey from eros in the "aesthetic authorship" to agape in the "second authorship" a personal attempt by Kierkegaard to sublimate his selfish desire for Regina into a self-sacrificing universal duty to love the neighbor. On his own terms this is impossible for a human being to achieve alone. It is only possible if love as agape is received as a gift by the grace of God.

f. The Attack on the Danish People's Church

The "authorship" and "second authorship" had been governed by Kierkegaard's elaborate method of "indirect communication." This method, inspired by Socrates and Christ, is designed to elicit self-examination from the reader in order to start the process of existential transfiguration that is entailed by Christian faith. It is designed to make it harder for the reader to appropriate the text objectively and dispassionately. Instead, the text is folded back on itself, layered with riddles and paradoxes, and designed to be a mirror in which the way the reader judges the text amounts to a self-judgment on the reader. The different works in the "authorships" are related to one another dialectically, so that a reader has to traverse a complicated journey to arrive at the threshold of Christian faith. The method of indirect communication requires meticulous attention to each word, and to the dialectical trajectory of the whole oeuvre. At times, the subtlety of the method nearly drove Kierkegaard to distraction, and he had to rely on the intervention of "Governance" [Styrelse], to let him know whether it was appropriate to publish the works he had written. On the Point of View for My Work as an Author: A Report to History, and The Book on Adler, failed to get Governance’s stamp of approval for publication.

But ultimately Kierkegaard began to think that this elaborate method of indirect communication, and his obsession with linguistic detail were temptations to the demonic. Besides, time was running out and some direct, decisive intervention in Danish church politics was necessary. This was precipitated by the death of the Bishop Primate of the Danish People's Church, J.P. Mynster (1854). Mynster had been the family pastor in Michael Kierkegaard’s day, and Søren Kierkegaard had always had a filial respect for him. But when the new Bishop Primate elect, H.L. Martensen, announced that Mynster had been "a witness to the truth" Kierkegaard could not restrain himself. He launched a stinging attack on the established church in a series of articles in the newspaper Fædrelandet [The Fatherland], and by means of a broadsheet called The Instant [or more literally "The Glint of an Eye"](1855) and in a series of other short, sharp pieces including This Must Be Said, So Let It Be Said (1855), and What Christ Judges of Official Christianity (1855). On September 28th 1855 Kierkegaard collapsed in the street. A few days later he was admitted to Frederiksberg Hospital in Copenhagen, where he died on November 11th.

2. The "Aesthetic Authorship"

a. On the Concept of Irony and Either/Or

Although Kierkegaard explicitly leaves On the Concept of Irony out of his "authorship," it functions as an important preface to that body of work. According to the theory of existential stages contained in the authorship, irony functions as a "confinium" [border area] between the aesthetic and the ethical. But it also functions as a point of entry to the aesthetic. As Kierkegaard argues in On the Concept of Irony, irony is a midwife at the birth of individual subjectivity. It is a distancing device, which folds immediate experience back on itself to create a space of self-reflection. In Socrates it is incarnated as "infinite negativity" - a force that undermines all received opinion to leave Socrates' interlocutors bewildered - and responsible for their own thoughts and values. That is, Socratic irony forces his interlocutors to reflect on themselves, to distance themselves critically from their immediate beliefs and values.

Although the aesthetic can consist in immediate immersion in sensuous experience, as in the case of Don Juan, Kierkegaard's most developed portrait is of the reflective aesthete in Either/Or volume 1. Faust is the first example of a reflective aesthete. He is lost in reflective ennui and craves a return to immediate experience. This is the basis of his attraction to Margarete, who embodies innocent immediacy. At its most extreme, the aesthete is unhappily and utterly self-alienated by means of temporal dislocation. "The Unhappiest One" - an echo of Hegel’s "unhappy consciousness" - hopes for that which can only be remembered, and remembers that which can only be hoped. He or she lives only in the modality of possibility and never in the modality of actuality, and therefore fails to be self-present. Yet, by means of reflective self-knowledge, the prudent rotation of moods and the arbitrary focus of interest, this "unhappiness" can be transformed into the greatest happiness for the aesthete. The "infinitizing" element of possibility becomes the realm of freedom, where even the most banal events can be "poeticized" by aesthetic sensibility. Actuality is transformed into nothing more than an occasion for generating reflective possibilities, rather than being an obstacle or a task. Johannes the seducer need see only a dainty ankle descending from a carriage to reconstruct the whole woman - just as Cuvier reconstructs the whole dinosaur from a single bone. The reconstruction, in the case of Johannes however, is not for the sake of knowing what’s real, but is for the sake of his own aesthetic titillation. If the actual doesn’t fit Johannes’ reflective desires, he manipulates it and himself until he generates a story that satisfies him. His seduction of Cordelia is not aimed at mere sexual consummation, but more at narrative consummation - she is to be used as an occasion, and manipulated in whatever ways Johannes deems necessary, to become the character in the story of seduction he has predetermined. But this detachment from the actual, by self-centered immersion in reflective possibility, is exactly what On the Concept of Irony had accused the German Romantics of achieving with their use of irony. The first volume of Either/Or just gives us a more developed version, artistically construed from the point of view of German Romantic irony. On the Concept of Irony had already argued for the necessity to go beyond immersion in irony, or mere possibility - to become a "master of irony," so that irony could be used strategically for ethical and religious ends. The title Either/Or presents us with a choice between the aesthetic and the ethical. The first volume is written from the point of view of the reflective aesthete, who has run astray in possibility. Although its main theme is love, this is conceived selfishly as erotic desire. The papers that comprise volume 1 are written ad se ipsum [to himself]. The aesthete's brilliant pyrotechnics are demonically self-enclosed, ironically cutting him off from genuine communication. The second volume, on the other hand, is written by a judge, who advocates transparency and openness in communication. It is written in the form of letters, as a direct communication to the aesthetic author of the first volume. The letters implore him to realize the limitations of his demonic self-enclosure, and to embrace his ethical duties to others. Whereas the paradigm of love in volume 1 is seduction, the paradigm of love in volume 2 is marriage. Marriage is a trope for the universal claims of civic duty. It requires an open, intimate, transparent, honest relation to an other. Yet the first section of volume 2 argues for the aesthetic validity of marriage. Judge Wilhelm wants to persuade the aesthete that ethical love is compatible with aesthetic love - that love in marriage does not exclude sensual enjoyment and love of beauty as such, but only the selfishness of lust for "the flesh." The latter is a category excluded by Christianity. It pertains to the body and psyche, to the exclusion of spirit, which is the definitive Christian category. Yet the claims of the judge ring hollow. Either/Or is presented as a whole book, edited by Victor Eremita (the victorious hermit). It presents us with a radical, exclusive choice between the aesthetic and the ethical, yet the judge tries to show their compatibility in marriage. The final word of the book belongs neither to the aesthete, the judge, nor even to the pseudonymous editor, but to an anonymous parson. His sermon, "The Edification Which Lies In The Fact That In Relation To God We Are Always In The Wrong," alerts the reader to the impossibility of escaping sin through ethics. The assumption shared by both the aesthete and the ethicist is that love can provide a means for ascent to the divine. Whereas erotic desire provides a means for the aesthete to ascend to a state of reflective possibility unconstrained by actuality, in which he becomes his own creator-god, the judge conceives ethical love to be a dialectical advance on aesthetic selfishness - in the direction of God. The whole pseudonymous authorship, from Either/Or to Concluding Unscientific Postscriptcan be read as a parody of the notion of a scala paradisi by means of which humans can ascend to the divine. The original model for this ladder to paradise is Plato's account of love [eros] in the Symposium. But the model is appropriated by many subsequent writers, including Augustine and Johannes Climacus, a sixth century monk from Mt. Sinai, who wrote a book called Scala Paradisi. Kierkegaard borrows this name for his pseudonymous author of Philosophical Fragments and Concluding Unscientific Postscript. But it is in order to parody the notion that humans can ascend to the divine under their own power. Each of the pseudonymous books in the "authorship" makes a gesture of movement from human to divine, whether by means of the aesthetic sublime, ethical virtue, the religious leap of faith, or philosophical dialectics. But in each case the apparent movement is "revoked" in some way. Ultimately Kierkegaard endorses the Lutheran view that human beings are radically dependent on God to descend to us. Human beings have no inherent capacity for transcending their own immanence, but are completely reliant on God’s grace to connect with alterity.

b. Fear and Trembling and Repetition

The next two books in the pseudonymous authorship, Fear and Trembling and Repetition, are supposed to represent a higher stage on the dialectical ladder - the religious. They are supposed to have moved beyond the aesthetic and the ethical. Fear and Trembling explicitly problematizes the ethical, while Repetition problematizes the notion of movement. Fear and Trembling reconstructs the story of Abraham and Isaac from the Old Testament. It tries to understand psychologically, ethically and religiously what Abraham was doing in obeying an apparent command from God to sacrifice his son. It apparently concludes that Abraham is "a knight of faith" who is religiously justified in his "teleological suspension of the ethical." The ethic in question here is the civic virtue championed by Judge Wilhelm in Either/Or - corresponding to Hegel's Sittlichkeit [customary morality]. The end for which this ethic is suspended is the unconditional command of God. But such obedience raises difficult epistemological questions - how do we distinguish the voice of God from, say, a delusional hallucination? The answer, which induces fear and trembling, is that we can only do so by faith. Abraham can say nothing to justify his actions - to do so would return him to the realm of human immanence and the sphere of ethics. The difference between Agamemnon, who sacrificed his daughter Iphigenia, and Abraham is that Agamemnon could justify his action in terms of customary morality. The sacrifice, however painful, was demanded for the sake of the success of the Greek military mission against Troy. Such sacrifices, for purposes greater than the individuals involved, were intelligible to the society of the time. Abraham’s sacrifice would have served no such purpose. It was unjustifiable in terms of prevailing morality, and was indistinguishable from murder. The ineffability of Abraham’s action is underscored by the pseudonym Kierkegaard chose as author of Fear and Trembling, namely, Johannes de silentio. But while Fear and Trembling is supposed to have moved beyond the aesthetic and the ethical, its subtitle is "a dialectical lyric." Although its subject matter is ineffable and its author silent, it effuses aesthetically on its theme. It ends with an "Epilogue" that asserts that, as far as love and faith go, we cannot build on what the previous generation has achieved. We have to begin from the beginning. We can never "go further."

Repetition begins with a discussion of the analysis of motion by the Eleatic philosophers. It goes on to distinguish two forms of movement with respect to knowledge of eternal truth: recollection and repetition. Recollection is understood on the model of Plato's anamnesis - a recovery of a truth already present in the individual, which has been repressed or forgotten. This is a movement backwards, since it is retrieving knowledge from the past. It can never discover eternal truth with which it was previously unacquainted. In contrast, repetition is defined as "recollection forwards." It is supposed to be the definitive movement of Christian faith. The pseudonym Constantin Constantius congratulates the Danish language on the word "Gjentagelse" [repetition], which more literally means "taking again." The emphasis in the Danish, then, is on the action involved in the repetition of faith rather than on the intellection involved in recollection. Christian faith is not a matter of intellectual reflection, but of living a certain sort of life, namely, imitating [repeating] the life of Christ. Despite this verbal analysis of the difference between recollection and repetition, the characters in Repetition fail to achieve religious repetition. The pseudonymous author fails in his attempt to repeat a journey to Berlin, and the "young man" who has been "poeticized" by love seems to move in the direction of the religious, but ultimately gets no further than religious poetry. He becomes obsessed with Job, the biblical paradigm of repetition. He substitutes the book of Job for the beloved he has rejected, even taking it to bed with him. But in the end the "young man" turns out to be no more than a fiction invented by Constantius as a psychological experiment. He falls back into the realm of aesthetics, of mere possibility, a figment for the psyche rather than the spirit.

c. Philosophical Fragments, The Concept of Anxiety, and Prefaces

In June 1844 Kierkegaard published three pseudonymous books: Philosophical Fragments, The Concept of Anxiety, and Prefaces. Philosophical Fragments, the first book by the pseudonym Johannes Climacus, tackles the question of how there can be an historical point of departure for an eternal truth. This picks up from Constantius' discussion of the difference between repetition and recollection. But Johannes uses the perspective and vocabulary of philosophy, rather than Constantius’ aesthetic irony. He introduces the paradox of the Christian incarnation as the stumbling block for any attempts by reason to ascend logically to the divine. The idea that the eternal, infinite, transcendent God could simultaneously be incarnated as a finite human being, in time, to die on the cross is an offense to reason. It is even too absurd an idea for humans to have invented, according to Climacus, so the idea itself must have a transcendent origin. In order for humans to encounter transcendent, eternal truth other than through recollection, the condition for reception of that truth must also have come from outside. If we have Christian faith, it is Christ as teacher who is the condition for receiving this truth - and he is conceived, precisely, as an incursion of the transcendent deity into the realm of human immanence. There can be no ascent to this truth by reason and logic, contra Hegel, who tries to demonstrate that "universal philosophical science" ultimately reveals "the Absolute."

The emphasis Climacus places on the paradox of the Christian incarnation, together with his assertion that this causes offense to reason, have prompted many to the view that Kierkegaard is an "irrationalist" about Christian faith. Some take this to mean that his view of faith is contrary to reason, or transcendent of reason - in either case, exclusive of reason. Others have sought to find means of reconciling Climacus' claims with some more extended notion of reason. It is important in considering these issues to distinguish Kierkegaard’s position from that of his pseudonym, and to take into account the point of view from which this consideration is made. Kierkegaard’s main aim in having Climacus make these claims is to undermine the idea that philosophical reason can be used as a scala paradisi. His principle target is Hegelianism, but he is also trying to distinguish pagan (especially Platonic) epistemology from Christian epistemology. We must also bear in mind that under the influence of Christian faith, all experience is transfigured ("everything is new in Christ"). This includes the experience of reason, as well as ethics and aesthetics. Ethics, for example, might be teleologically suspended in faith, but is recouped within Christian faith - though it comes to have another meaning. It is no longer merely customary morality, but is the morality sanctioned by Christian love, which is deontological, centered on spirit rather than sympathy, self-sacrificing, and is mediated by God (the "third" in every love relation). Similarly aesthetics is transfigured under Christian faith, from self-serving reflections confined to the realm of possibility, to the beauty inherent in altruistic self-effacing acts of love. Reason itself comes to have another meaning under Christian faith, so that it no longer takes offense at the paradox, but recognizes its necessity given the exigencies of relating the transcendent to the immanent without reduction. Reason is recontextualized within existence, rather than being elevated to absorb the whole of existence. Prefaces: Light Reading for Certain Classes as the Occasion May Require reinforces the polemic against Hegel's speculative ladder of reason. Although much of its content is devoted to satirical broadsides at J.L. Heiberg, H.L. Martensen, and the popular press in Copenhagen, its starting point is the paradox of philosophical prefaces articulated in the preface to Hegel’s The Phenomenology of Spirit. Hegel’s assumption is that a philosophical work should be a sort of Bildungsroman - a narrative by means of which the reader’s consciousness is dialectically developed in the course of reading. If we assume the reader is to learn something from the process of reading the book, then he or she will not be in a position to understand the conclusions of the book until they have worked their way through the content. By the time they reach the end they will be conditioned by what they have read to understand the conclusion. But a preface presents the conclusions to the book at the outset. It is really an anticipatory postface rather than a preface. The reader will really only be able to understand it after having read the book. It is meant for orientation of the reader on embarking on the voyage of self-development represented by the book. But if it is a direct bridge into the book, the subject matter itself, then it is really part of the book rather than a preface. If, on the other hand, it stands radically outside the book, then it can’t be a bridge into the book and is redundant. This gap between preface and book parallels the gap Hegel draws between "particular philosophical sciences" (such as aesthetics, and history of philosophy) and "universal philosophical science" (logic). The former must be used as a contingent starting point, commensurate with the limited knowledge of the reader, as a point of induction into logic. The particular can retrospectively be subsumed within the universal, but cannot be expanded to become the universal. It has been claimed, in accordance with this position, that if the reader understands the preface to Hegel’s Phenomenology of Spirit, he or she understands the whole of Hegel’s philosophy. But the condition for understanding the preface is already to understand the whole of Hegel’s philosophy. The pseudonymous author of Prefaces, Nicholas Notabene, is a pedant whose wife has forbidden him to be an author. He takes an author to be a writer of books, and with cunning sophistry decides to write nothing but prefaces "which are not the prefaces to any books." Notabene's prefaces are analogues of human immanence - no amount of expansion will make them bridges to the transcendent. All human immanence is a "preface" to the divine. Only once the divine has come to us (in the incarnation or through direct revelation) can we retrospectively understand the status of our prefatory lives as mere prefaces. For Kierkegaard there is only one book - the bible. We are never "authors" of books, but only readers of "the old familiar text handed down from the fathers." On the same day as he published Prefaces Kierkegaard also published On the Concept of Anxiety by Vigilius Haufniensis [Watchman of the Harbor - namely, Copenhagen]. Its subtitle is "A Simple Psychologically Orienting Deliberation on the Dogmatic Issue of Hereditary Sin." It is supposed to be a serious counterweight to the "light reading" of Prefaces. But it forms part of the same polemic against immanent human efforts to reach the divine. From the points of view of psychology and theological dogmatics it elaborates the theme of the sermon appended to Either/Or - that against God we are always in the wrong. Sin is inescapable. Sin ultimately consists in being outside of God. Only Jesus Christ, the God-man, is not in sin. Sin consciousness comes into being as part of human psychological development. It is absent from the innocent immediacy of childhood. It awakens with sexual desire - when we want to possess another. Desire is here understood as a lack that we want to fill. Possession, or incorporation of the other, is thought to be the way to fulfill the desire. In erotic love it feels as though part of ourselves is outside of us, and needs to be reintegrated (as in Aristophanes' explanation of love in Plato’s Symposium). This is the beginning of self-alienation and the loss of innocent immediacy. Self-alienation is a necessary stage on the way to becoming a self. A self is a synthesis of finite and infinite, temporal and eternal, body and soul, held together by spirit. Only with the diremption of these aspects of the self, through self-alienation, does spirit arise. But spirit can only achieve the synthesis of self if it acknowledges its absolute dependence in this task on God ("the power that posits it"). Long before it gets to this stage, the person feels anxiety in the face of self-alienation. Anxiety is an ambivalent state, "a sympathetic antipathy and an antipathetic sympathy." It is the intimation of the delights of freedom, but also of the dread responsibility that is a consequence of freedom. Like vertigo, it is the simultaneous fascination and fear of the abyss - a hypnotic possibility of falling that induces the dizziness to actually fall. The main arena for the exercise of freedom is in becoming a self. But this requires alienation from one's immediate sensate being, taking ethical responsibility for one’s relations to other people, and acknowledgement of one’s ultimate dependence on God. Each of these entails risk - and hence anxiety. One of the risks involved is the possibility of falling prey to the demonic. A key definition of this notion is "self-enclosed reserve" [Indesluttethed] - a state in which the individual fails to relate to an other as other, but returns into him or herself in narcissism or solipsism. Kierkegaard feared that his convoluted, indirect writing could be his own form of the demonic, and ultimately opted for more direct forms of communication.

d. Stages on Life's Way and Concluding Unscientific Postscript

Like many of Kierkegaard's pseudonymous works, Stages on Life’s Way repeats elements from earlier pseudonymous works. In particular, it repeats the device of nesting narrators within narrators, it repeats characters from Either/Or and Repetition, and it "repeats" "The Seducer’s Diary" in "Quidam’s Diary." The latter was originally conceived at the same time as "The Diary of the Seducer" but was to differ by having the seducer undermined by his own depression once he had won the girl. Stages also repeats the idea built up over the sequence of pseudonymous works that human existence can be conceived as falling into distinct "stages" or "spheres," which are related in a dialectical progression. Stages repeats the same stages that have already been traversed in the preceding works, apparently without making any progress.

It is another example of the false ladder to paradise, exemplified by Plato's ladder of eros. The first major section of Stages, "In Vino Veritas," borrows its title from Plato’s Symposium and is modeled explicitly on that work, both structurally and thematically. It consists in a group of men at a banquet, each discoursing in turn on the nature of (erotic) love. This section of the book is followed by "Some Reflections on Marriage" by Judge Wilhelm, to give an ethical perspective on love. This is followed by "Quidam’s Diary," which is supposed to follow a trajectory from erotic love to religious consciousness. But Quidam’s diary is framed by the words of Frater Taciturnus (a distorted repetition of Johannes de silentio), in which he tells us that Quidam’s diary was retrieved from the bottom of a lake. It was enclosed in a box with the key locked inside - a symbol of the demonic. Later Frater Taciturnus tells the reader explicitly that Quidam is demonic "in the direction of the religious." Furthermore, like the "young man" from Repetition, Quidam is only a fiction invented by Frater Taciturnus to illustrate a point. As we read through Stages it looks as though we are progressing from the aesthetic, through the ethical to the religious. But Frater Taciturnus pulls the ladder out from under our feet in his "Letter to the Reader." He even suggests that there might not be any reader, in which case he is content to talk to himself - i.e. return demonically into himself, rather than relate himself earnestly to an actual other. Concluding Unscientific Postscript repeats these movements of Stages. It proclaims itself to be only a postscript to the Philosophical Fragments, which any attentive reader of that book could have written, and contains an extensive review of the pseudonymous authorship to date. The self-proclaimed humorist, Johannes Climacus takes up the problematic of Philosophical Fragments of whether there can be an historical point of departure for eternal truth. He seems to conclude that since it is impossible to demonstrate the objective truth of Christianity's claims, the most the individual can do is to concentrate on the how of appropriation of those claims. This issues in the extensive discussion of inwardness and subjectivity, which is usually taken as the basis for the accusation that Kierkegaard is an "irrationalist." Climacus, but not Kierkegaard, proclaims that "truth is subjectivity" (as well as "subjectivity is untruth"). Climacus also makes a distinction between two types of religiousness: "Religiousness A" and "Religiousness B." The former is the pagan conception of religion and is characterized by intelligibility, immanence, and recognition of continuity between temporality and eternity. Religiousness B is dubbed "paradoxical religiousness" and is supposed to represent the essence of Christianity. It posits a radical divide between immanence and transcendence, a discontinuity between temporality and eternity, yet also claims that the eternal came into existence in time. This is a paradox and can only be believed "by virtue of the absurd." The distinction between "Religiousness A" and "Religiousness B" is another expression of the distinction between recollection and repetition, or between eros and agape, or between immanence and transcendence. It is supposed to mark the gulf between Christianity and all other forms of faith. The paradox of the Christian incarnation is presented as an offense to reason, which can only be overcome by a leap of faith. But even a leap is under the control of the individual. It might take more courage and induce more anxiety than the steady step-by-step ascension of a ladder. One is out over 70000 fathoms. But Climacus is a humorist. Humor is characterized as a means of "revoking" existence. Although Climacus writes about Christian faith, he doesn't live it. He represents in the modality of possibility what can only be experienced in the modality of actuality. At the end of Concluding Unscientific Postscript, Climacus explicitly revokes everything he has said - though he is careful to add that to say something and revoke it is not the same as never having said it at all. That is, at the end of the pseudonymous scala paradisi, the pseudonymous author proclaims that what he has said is misleading - because it presents a continuity between immanent human categories of thought and the divine in the form of analogy. But there is no analogy to the divine. It is sui generis. It is "the book" to human life as "preface."

3. The Edifying Discourses

a. Sermons, Deliberations, and Edifying Discourses

Simultaneously with the publication of the aesthetic pseudonymous works, Kierkegaard published a series of works he called "Edifying Discourses" [Opbyggelige Taler]. These were written under his own name and most of them were dedicated "To the Late Michael Pedersen Kierkegaard, Formerly a Clothing Merchant Here in the City, My Father." Although they typically take a New Testament theme as their point of departure, Kierkegaard explicitly denies that they are sermons. This is because he had not been ordained, and so wrote "without authority." They are also addressed to "that single individual" and not to a congregation.

Kierkegaard distinguishes his "edifying discourses" as a genre from other works he calls "deliberations" [Overveielser]. Edifying discourses "build up" whereas deliberations are a "weighing up." Edifying discourses presuppose Christian faith and terminology as given and understood, and build on that. They are meant to augment the faith and love of the Christian reader. Deliberations, while they may ostensibly deal with the same subject matter, imply that the reader stands outside the matter being weighed. But this is in a particular sense. In weighing something on a scale, we measure two weights against one another. In deliberating, the reader weighs the temporal significance of the subject matter against its eternal significance. The deliberation, as a type of writing, weighs into the reader's balance of temporal and eternal with polemical force. It is meant to turn the normal, worldly view topsy-turvy. Works of Love is subtitled "Some Christian Deliberations in the Form of Discourses." It has the polemical, topsy-turvy nature of deliberation, but contains within it the form of the discourse. Furthermore, one of the explicit themes of these discourses is edification. But because of the framework of deliberation, the discourses about edification are not necessarily for edification. They don't presuppose an understanding of the Christian categories, but are meant to lead the reader to an understanding - through deliberation. The earlier pseudonymous book, The Concept of Anxiety is subtitled "A Simple Psychologically Orienting Deliberation on the Dogmatic Issue of Hereditary Sin." Like Works of Love it is a serious weighing up of various Christian concepts, in a manner designed to provoke readers to rethink the relation between the temporal and eternal in their lives. Kierkegaard uses yet other related genres besides deliberations and edifying discourses. The pseudonym Anti-Climacus uses the subtitles "A Christian Psychological Exposition [Udvikling] for Edification and Awakening" (The Sickness Unto Death) and "For Awakening and Making Inward" (Practice in Christianity). These are written from an idealized Christian point of view, so not only presuppose an understanding of the Christian categories, but seek to raise the level of awareness to the highest level of Christian faith.

b. Direct and Indirect Communication

Kierkegaard struggled to find appropriate means of communication that would address the inward nature of Christian faith. He thought his contemporaries had too much (objective) knowledge, which needed stripping away, before they could achieve awareness of individual inwardness. Everything was made too easy for people, with the press providing ready-made opinions, popular culture providing ready-made values, and speculative philosophy providing promissory notes in place of real achievements. Kierkegaard's task as a communicator was, initially, to make things more difficult. In order to do this, he devised a method of indirect communication. This was designed to confront the reader with paradox, contradiction, and difficulty by means of refraction of the narrative point of view through pseudonyms, prefaces, postscripts, interludes, preliminary expectorations, repetitions, irony, revocation and other devices that obscure the author’s intention. These devices are meant to undermine the authority of the author, so any "truths" contained in the text cannot merely be learned by rote or appropriated "objectively." Instead, the text is meant to supply a polished surface in which the reader comes to see him or herself. The manner in which the reader appropriates the text, understands it, and judges it will disclose more about the reader than about the text.

Part of the method of indirect communication was to juxtapose two series of texts: the pseudonymous texts and the "edifying discourses." The latter were published under Kierkegaard's own name, and were co-extensive with the pseudonymous authorship. They are evidence that he was a religious author from the outset. The indirect method of the pseudonymous works is often convoluted, obscure, and a combination of personal confession and obfuscation (of those confessions). The whole of the pseudonymous authorship from Either/Or to Concluding Unscientific Postscript can be read as a parody of Hegel’s Encyclopedia of the Philosophical Sciences - an enormously baroque conceit that threatens to become demonic in its obscurity and labyrinthine complexity. This complexity is balanced by the relatively simple thematic variations on biblical texts to be found in the edifying discourses. The latter were direct communications - but addressed only to Christians who could understand them. The indirect works, on the other hand, were designed to seduce or deceive into the truth those who stand outside it - such as the Danish Hegelians and their followers. By parodying Hegel’s Encyclopedia, Kierkegaard was undermining the whole system on which the Danish Hegelians placed so much faith. He supplemented his parody of Hegel with more specific jibes at particular Danish Hegelians throughout the "authorship." Kierkegaard continued to write edifying discourses in conjunction with the "second authorship," to accompany the works of the pseudonym Anti-Climacus. After the "second authorship" he wrote Christian discourses that were more polemical and strident than the edifying discourses. They were equally "direct" - being published under his own name, but addressed different emotions and values.

c. That Single Individual, My Reader

Kierkegaard's edifying discourses are addressed to "that single individual, my reader." When he first used this address he meant it to apply to Regina Olsen. But he came to see that it had a wider application. He had polemicized from his earliest writings against the press, and against cultural and political tendencies to "level" individuals into homogeneous masses. His term of loathing for the depersonalized, de-individualized instrument of leveling was "the crowd." It corresponds to Nietzsche’s notion of "the herd" and to Heidegger’s notion of "das Man." One subset of "the crowd" that especially attracted Kierkegaard’s ire was "the reading public." This was the anonymous mass, consumer of the secondhand literary opinion of "reviewers." Most reviewers, in Kierkegaard’s opinion, were hasty, ill-informed panderers to public opinion, so that reviewers and public fed off each other in a vicious circle. Reviews were even written without the reviewer having read the book, then circulated through gossip by "the reading public" as final judgment on the book. The anonymous circulation of public gossip is the antithesis of serious engagement with truth on a personal level.

Christianity addresses the single individual. Its truths, according to Kierkegaard, must be appropriated inwardly, seriously and with infinite passion. Just as we cannot die another's death, we cannot live another’s faith. Existing inwardly in passion as an individual is a prerequisite for Christian faith. Having Christian faith is a prerequisite for understanding the edifying discourses. So the edifying discourses are addressed to each single individual. The pseudonymous works in the aesthetic authorship often have letters addressed to the reader too. But, as in the case of the letters of Constantine Constantius and Frater Taciturnus, they turn out to be soliloquies addressed to themselves more than direct, open communications to a reader posited as genuinely other.

4. The "Second Authorship"

a. Works of Love

Works of Love was written under Kierkegaard's own name. Its subtitle places it within the genre of "Christian deliberations" - i.e. polemical weighings-up of Christian notions. It does not presuppose an existential understanding of Christian love, as it would were it an "edifying discourse," but challenges the reader to open him or herself to the specifically Christian understanding of love. For a reader who understands love principally in terms of eros, the Christian notion of love as agape is counterintuitive. Whereas eros is a preferential feeling of desire, agape is a spiritual duty to serve the neighbor (without discrimination in terms of preference). Whereas eros is ultimately selfish, aimed at satisfying the lover’s desire, agape is selfless, requiring self-sacrifice. Whereas eros is often built on the visual objectification of the beloved, agape requires the individual to become "transparent" and "as nothing" before God. Whereas eros is typically a relation between two people, agape always involves God as the "third" in the relation.

Works of Love concentrates not so much on the understanding of love as such, but on the understanding of works of love. Love will be known as the fruit of these works of love. Since God is love, it can only be known through the existential commitment of Christian faith. This faith is only lived in the attempt to imitate the life of Christ. Christ's life was itself God’s principal work of love for human beings. It is only through this work of love that we can know God as love. The only true work of love is helping someone else achieve autonomy through Christian love. But if that person sees that he or she was dependent on some other human being to achieve autonomy, that autonomy will be undone. The human author of a work of love must disappear in the act of love, so that only the love is perceived and only God is recognized as its author. This presents Kierkegaard with a difficult task in writing Works of Love. If it helps its readers achieve autonomy through an understanding of Christian love, and the readers recognize Kierkegaard to be the author, it will fail to be a work of love. Kierkegaard has to disappear as author in order for the book to function as a work of love. He resorts to the device of the dash [Tankestreg] to achieve his disappearance. He explicitly talks about this use of the dash during the course of Works of Love, and ends the penultimate section of the book with a dash (unfortunately omitted from the English translation). The conclusion that follows the dash is a presentation of the words of the Apostle John. As an Apostle, John presents the word of God. The word of God is a record of the life of Christ, which is God’s work of love. So God’s word is the work of love. Kierkegaard, by means of the dash, erases his ego as an author to allow the word of God to shine through - thereby preserving Works of Love as a work of love.

b. Anti-Climacus

Anti-Climacus is the pseudonymous author of two of Kierkegaard's mature works: The Sickness Unto Death (1849) and Practice in Christianity (1850). As his name indicates, Anti-Climacus represents the antithesis of Johannes Climacus. As we have seen, Climacus derives his name from the monk who wrote Scala Paradisi, thereby embracing the idea that it is possible for human beings to ascend to heaven under their own power. The "aesthetic" authorship, culminating in Concluding Unscientific Postscript, explores a number of possible modes of scaling heaven - by means of erotic love, the Babel tower of aesthetic poetry, ethical works, or speculative reason. All are found wanting. Having established the absolute nature of transcendence through repeated parodies of these vain attempts in the aesthetic authorship, Kierkegaard proceeds to show through Anti-Climacus how various aesthetic concepts are transfigured from an ideal Christian point of view.

The central notions explored in The Sickness Unto Death are "despair" and "the self." In this respect it is a Christian repetition of the central themes of The Concept of Anxiety, with "despair" supplanting "anxiety." Both explore the task of becoming a self from the points of view of psychology and Christian faith. Both invoke sin as the greatest obstacle to becoming a self. Yet paradoxically, becoming conscious of sin is a prerequisite for faith and selfhood. Anti-Climacus distinguishes between "human being" and "self." The human being is a synthesis, of infinite and finite, temporal and eternal, freedom and necessity, body and soul. The self, on the other hand, is the process of relating these elements of synthesis to one another. The self is the task of maintaining the proper equilibrium of the synthesis. But this task is beyond the capacity of a mere human being alone. Willing to be a self is itself a form of despair. Not willing to be a self is also a form of despair. Being unaware of the possibility of being a self is also a form of despair. The only antidote to despair is Christian faith. Faith provides the missing element in the synthesis, namely, an acknowledgement of God as the necessary underpinning of the self-relation. But to become aware of God, one first has to become aware of one's absolute difference from God. This is the function of sin-consciousness. Sin-consciousness presupposes God-consciousness. The ultimate form of despair is despairing over one’s sin, and thereby failing to accept God’s forgiveness. Only through the movement of faith can God’s grace be received and accepted, thereby acknowledging God’s absolute alterity as well as our absolute dependence on God to be selves. Practice in Christianity complements The Sickness Unto Death thematically. It deals with the appropriate Christian response to divine grace, and with healing through penitence. But it also repeats some of the themes of Philosophical Fragments and Concluding Unscientific Postscript. In particular it revisits the themes of offense and the historical point of departure for eternal truth. The latter is explored under the rubric of becoming contemporary with the absolute. Christian faith is the only means for the immanent, temporal human being to have contact with the transcendent, eternal truth, since that faith consists in believing that Christ was the incarnation of God. That faith consists not merely in intellectual belief, but in willingness to imitate the life of Christ to the utmost of one's powers. Anti-Climacus catalogues various ways in which we might take offense at someone claiming to be the "God-man." In the process he discusses the necessity for God, as transcendent, to use a method of indirect communication. The God-man needs to be "incognito" - to arrive in the unrecognizable form of a servant. He needs to suffer, to be spurned, to avoid any possible direct revelation of His exalted status. Only by means of indirect communication, rather than by direct revelation, will the individual come to relate to the God-man through faith. The possibility of faith is the obverse of the possibility of offense. Offense is underscored by means of the Almighty's lowly incognito and indirect method of communication.

c. The Attack on the Church

Kierkegaard came to think that perhaps indirect communication should be the exclusive provenance of the God-man. He came increasingly to regard his own indirection, and his love affair with language, to be demonic temptations. When the Bishop Primate of the Danish People's Church, his father’s old pastor J.P. Mynster, died in January 1854, Kierkegaard felt free to attack the established church more directly and stridently. He had suppressed some critical and potentially offensive writings while Mynster was still alive. But he was precipitated into a full frontal attack when the new Bishop Primate, H.L. Martensen, Kierkegaard’s old rival, publicly described the late Mynster as "a witness to the truth." Kierkegaard had respected Mynster as a pastor and a man, but found his administration of the church wanting. Mynster had steered the church into closer relations with the state, and had shored up the values of "Christendom" rather than "Christianity." The former was a phenomenon of cultural history; the latter was the vehicle of passionate, inward individual faith. Given the leveling tendencies of "the present age," Christendom as a cultural phenomenon was on a collision course with Christian faith. It threatened to replace "the single individual" with "the crowd" (under the guise of "the congregation"), struggle with mediation, revolution with reflection, and works of love with the welfare state. Worst, it threatened to usurp eternal truth with temporal gossip. Therefore, to call its chief spokesman a "witness to the truth" provoked an extreme reaction from Kierkegaard.

His discourses changed from gentle edifications to strident calls to arms. He moved from a position of "armed neutrality" with respect to church politics, to one of decisive intervention in "the instant." "The Instant" [Øieblikket - literally 'the glint of an eye'] was Kierkegaard’s final frenetic publication. The Concept of Anxiety had identified "the instant" as the point of intersection of time and eternity. It is the moment of decision, the moment of transfiguring vision, the moment of contemporaneity with Christ. It was also the moment to let go of indirect communication and to speak directly. "The Instant" was the name of a broadsheet Kierkegaard published to continue his attack on the state church. He published ten issues between its inception in May 1855 and the last in September 1855, when he collapsed and was admitted to hospital. But to speak directly, having spoken for so long indirectly, is not the same as the "objective" direct communication he originally resisted. It was not a direct communication about eternal truth, but a timely intervention in contemporary politics. It was a verbal act, rather than a measured contribution to literature. Another important part of the "second authorship" consists in the self-reflections Kierkegaard wrote on his own work as an author. In 1851 he published On My Work as an Author, but had also written several other works that were only published posthumously. These include The Point of View for my Work as an Author: A Report to History (1859), Armed Neutrality, or My Position as a Christian Author in Christendom (1880), and "Three Notes Concerning my Activity as an Author" (1859). He also withheld from publication The Book on Adler, an extended study of Adolph Adler, a prominent Hegelian and pastor in the Danish People's Church. Adler claimed to have received divine revelation, but Kierkegaard’s analysis of his writings tries to demonstrate Adler’s confusion. Adler becomes, in Kierkegaard’s words, "a Satire on Hegelian Philosophy and the Present Age." Kierkegaard also used Adler’s case to distinguish between "a genius" and "an apostle." Another work, also published posthumously, was "The Ethical and Ethico-religious Dialectic of Communication" (1877). Kierkegaard agonized over whether to publish these direct communications about his own strategies of communication and how he saw his activity as an author. Of particular concern was how these direct writings would affect the complex dialectic of direct and indirect communications he had set up in his "authorships." Ultimately he relied on the guidance of "Governance" [Styrelse] to decide whether or not to publish - much as Socrates had relied on the warnings of his daimonion about whether to engage people in philosophical cross-examination. Retrospectively, Kierkegaard regarded his activity as an author to have been under the direction of Governance. He had not had a clear view at the outset about the structure of his authorships, but had come to see that what he had been directed to write was what was required for a religious poet in the present age. He was a writer who overflowed with ideas - far too many to write down. Therefore Governance had to sit him down like a schoolboy, and make him write as though he were writing "a work assignment." In much the same way as he disappeared under the dash in works of love, Kierkegaard "disappears" in these accounts of his own activity as a writer under the sign of "Governance."

5. References and Further Reading

Kierkegaard's Writings

Danish

  • Breve og Aktstykker vedrørende Søren Kierkegaaard, ed. Niels Thulstrup, Copenhagen: Munksgaard, 1953-4.
  • Søren Kierkegaards Papirer, ed. P.A. Heiberg, V. Kuhr & E. Torsting, second edition Niels Thulstrup, Copenhagen: Gyldendal, 1968-78.
  • Søren Kierkegaards Samlede Værker, ed. A.B. Drachmann, J.L. Heiberg & H.D. Lange, second edition, Copenhagen: Nordisk Forlag, 1920-36.
  • Søren Kierkegaards Skrifter, ed. N.J. Cappelørn, et.al., Copenhagen: Gad, 1997-.
  • English Kierkegaard's Writings volumes 1-XXVI, ed. & trans. H.V. Hong, et.al. Princeton University Press: 1978-2000.

Commentary

  • Cappelørn, Niels Jørgen, Hermann Deuser, et.al. (eds), Kierkegaard Studies Yearbook 1996-, Berlin & New York: Walter de Gruyter, 1996-
  • Ferreira, M. Jamie, Love's Grateful Striving: A Commentary on Kierkegaard’s Works of Love, Oxford University Press, 2001
  • Garff, Joakim, SAK: Søren Aabye Kierkegaard: en biografi, Copenhagen: Gad, 2000
  • Hannay, Alastair, Kierkegaard: A Biography, Cambridge University Press, 2001
  • Hannay, Alastair & Gordon Marino (eds), The Cambridge Companion to Kierkegaard, Cambridge University Press, 1998
  • Kirmmse, Bruce, Encounters With Kierkegaard, Princeton University Press, 1996
  • Kirmmse, Bruce, Kierkegaard in Golden Age Denmark, Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1990
  • Mackey, Louis, Points of View: Readings of Kierkegaard, Tallahassee: Florida State University Press, 1986
  • Malantschuk, Gregor, Kierkegaard's Thought, ed. & trans. H.V. Hong & E.H. Hong, Princeton University Press, 1971
  • Pattison, George, Kierkegaard: The Aesthetic and the Religious, New York: St. Martin's Press, 1992
  • Perkins, Robert L (ed.), International Kierkegaard Commentary, Macon: Mercer University Press
    • This is a series of anthologies of essays, with each volume designed to accompany the volumes comprising Kierkegaard's Writings, op.cit.

Author Information

William McDonald
Email: wmcdonal@metz.une.edu.au
University of New England
Australia

Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani (d. 1020)

Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani was a prominent Ismaili missionary during the reign of the Fatimid caliph-imam al-Hakim (996-1021). He was of Persian origin and was probably born in the province of Kirman. He seems to have spent the greater part of his life as a Fatimid da‘i (missionary) in Iraq (in Baghdad and Basra) and in central and western parts of Iran.Al-Kirmani was part of the official Fatimid campaign against the dissident da‘is, who had also proclaimed al-Hakim’s divinity. In Cairo he produced several works in refutation of the Druze movement and religion. Subsequently, al-Kirmani returned to Iraq where he completed his last and magnum opus, Rahat al-‘aql.

A prolific writer, al-Kirmani was one of the most learned Ismaili theologians of the Fatimid times. He was well-acquainted with the Hebrew text of the Old Testament, the Syriac version of the New Testament, and the post-Biblical Jewish writings. He expounded the Ismaili Shi‘i doctrine of the imamate in numerous writings. In a few treatises, al-Kirmani refuted the theological views of the Zaydis, the Twelver Shi‘is, and other Muslim opponents of the Fatimid Ismaili imams. Al-Kirmani was also an accomplished philosopher belonging to that select group of Ismaili da‘is of the Iranian lands who amalgamated in an original manner their Ismaili theology with different philosophical traditions, notably a type of Neoplatonism then current in the Muslim world.

Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani was a prominent Ismaili da‘i or missionary and one of the most learned Ismaili theologians and philosophers of the Fatimid period. As in the case of other prominent missionaries who observed strict secrecy in their activities in the midst of hostile milieus, few biographical details are available on al-Kirmani, who flourished during the reign of the Fatimid caliph-imam al-Hakim (996-1021). Al-Kirmani is not mentioned in any contemporary Muslim historical sources, but highlights of his life and career can be gathered from his own numerous extant works as well as the writings of the later Musta‘li-Tayyibi Ismaili authors of Yaman.

Al-Kirmani’s date of birth remains unknown, but he was of Persian origin and was probably born in the province of Kirman. He seems to have spent the greater part of his life as a Fatimid da‘i in Iraq, having been particularly active in Baghdad and Basra. In Iraq, al-Kirmani successfully concentrated his efforts on local rulers and influential tribal chiefs, with whose support the Ismailis aimed to bring about the downfall of the ‘Abbasids. Alarmed by the successes of the Fatimid da‘wa or mission in Iraq, the ‘Abbasid caliph al-Qadir took retaliatory measures. In 1011, he sponsored the so-called Baghdad manifesto to discredit the Fatimids, also refuting their ‘Alid ancestry. The honorific title hujjat al-Iraqayn, meaning the hujja or chief da‘i of both Iraqs (al-Iraq al-Arabi and al-Iraq al-Ajami), which is often added to al-Kirmani’s name and may be of a late origin, implies that he was also active in central and western parts of Iran.

Al-Kirmani rose to prominence during the reign of al-Hakim, when the central headquarters of the Fatimid da‘wa in Cairo considered him as the most learned Ismaili theologian of the time. It was in that capacity that al-Kirmani played an important role in refuting the extremist ideas of some dissident da‘is, who were then founding what was to become known as the Druze movement and religion. As part of the official Fatimid campaign against the dissident da‘is, who had also proclaimed al-Hakim’s divinity, al-Kirmani was summoned in 1014 or shortly earlier to Cairo where he produced several works in refutation of the extremist doctrines. Al-Kirmani’s writings, which were widely circulated, were to some extent successful in checking the spread of the extremist doctrines associated with the initiation of the Druze movement. Subsequently, al-Kirmani returned to Iraq where he completed his last and magnum opus, Rahat al-‘aql, in 1020 and where he died soon afterwards.

A prolific writer, al-Kirmani was one of the most learned Ismaili theologians of the Fatimid times. He was well-acquainted with the Hebrew text of the Old Testament, the Syriac version of the New Testament, and the post-Biblical Jewish writings. He expounded the Ismaili Shi‘i doctrine of the imamate in numerous writings. In a few treatises, al-Kirmani refuted the theological views of the Zaydis, the Twelver Shi‘is, and other Muslim opponents of the Fatimid Ismaili imams. In his al-Aqwal al-dhahabiya, al-Kirmani refuted the ideas of Abu Bakr Mohammad b. Zakariya al-Razi (d. 934), who had argued for the necessity of revelation and prophethood while tracing all sciences to revelational origins. Al-Kirmani was also an accomplished philosopher belonging to that select group of Ismaili da‘is of the Iranian lands who amalgamated in an original manner their Ismaili theology (kalam) with different philosophical traditions, notably a type of Neoplatonism then current in the Muslim world. As a philosopher, al-Kirmani was fully acquainted with Aristotelian and Neoplatonic philosophies as well as the metaphysical systems of the Muslim philosophers (falasifa), notably al-Farabi, and Ibn Sina (Avicenna) who was his contemporary. In his Kitab al-riyad, al-Kirmani acted as an arbiter in a philosophical debate that had taken place earlier among some Iranian da‘is, notably Muhammad al-Nasafi, Abu YaRahat al-‘aql, which is written for the advanced adepts. In this book, al-Kirmani also propounded what may be regarded as the third stage in the development of Ismaili cosmology in medieval times. Al-Kirmani replaced the Neoplatonic dyad of the Intellect (‘aql) and Soul (nafs) in the spiritual world, which had been adopted by his Iranian Ismaili predecessors, by a series of ten separate Intellects in partial adaptation of al-Farabi’s Aristotelian cosmic system. Al-Kirmani’s cosmology, representing an original synthesis of different philosophical traditions, was not however adopted by the Fatimid Ismailis; it later provided the basis for the development of the fourth and final stage of Ismaili cosmology at the hands of the Musta‘li-Tayyibi scholars in Yaman.

References and Further Reading

  • W. Ivanow, Ismaili Literature: A Bibliographical Survey, Tehran, 1963, pp. 40-45. Contains a survey of al-Kirmani’s known works and their manuscripts, preserved mainly in Yaman and India.
  • I. K. Poonawala, Biobibliography of Ismaili Literature Malibu, Calif., 1977, pp. 94-102. Also contains a survey of al-Kirmani’s known works and their manuscripts, preserved mainly in Yaman and India.
  • J. van Ess, “Bibliographische Notizen zur islamischen Theologie. I. Zur Chronologie der Werke des Hamidaddin al-Kirmani”, Die Welt des Orients, 9, 1978, pp. 255-261. A partial chronology of al-Kirmani’s works.
  • W. Madelung, “Das Imamat in der frühen ismailitischen Lehre”, Der Islam, 37, 1961, pp. 114-127.
  • H. Corbin, Cyclical Time and Ismaili Gnosis, London, 1983, index.
  • F. Daftary, The Ismailis: Their History and Doctrines, Cambridge, 1990, pp. 113, 192-193, 196-197, 218, 227, 229-230, 235-236, 240, 245-246, 287, 291, 298.
  • Paul E. Walker, Early Philosophical Shiism, Cambridge, 1993, index.
  • Paul. E. Walker, Hamid al-Din al-Kirmani: Ismaili Thought in the Age of al-Hakim, London, 1999.
  • Daniel De Smet, La Quiétude de l’intellect: Néoplatonisme et gnose ismaélienne dans l’oeuvre de Hamid ad-Din al-Kirmani, Louvain, 1995.

Author Information

Farhad Daftary
Email: info@iis.ac.uk
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Bernard Lonergan (1904—1984)

When we try to reconcile opposing moral opinions we usually appeal to shared ethical principles. Yet often enough the principles themselves are opposed. We may then try to reconcile opposing principles by clarifying how we arrived at them. But since most of our principles are cultural inheritances, discussions halt at a tolerant mutual respect, even when we remain convinced that the other person is wrong. What is needed is a method in ethics that can uncover the sources of error. After all, even culturally inherited principles first occurred to someone, and that someone may or may not have been biased. So there is considerable merit to investigating the innate methods of our minds and hearts by which we construe – and sometimes misconstrue – ethical principles. The work of Bernard Lonergan can guide this investigation. His opus covers methodological issues in the natural sciences, the human sciences, historical scholarship, aesthetics, economics, philosophy and theology. He begins with an invitation to consider in ourselves what occurs when we come to knowledge. He then defines a corresponding epistemological meaning of objectivity. From there he lays out basic metaphysical categories applicable in the sciences. Finally, he proposes a methodical framework for collaboration in resolving basic differences in all these disciplines.

This review will begin by tracing the origins of Lonergan's approach. Following that will be the four steps of a cognitional theory, an epistemology, a metaphysics, and a methodology, particularly as they apply to resolving differences in moral opinions and in ethical principles. Finally, there will be a reexamination of several fundamental categories in ethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Origins
  2. Cognitional Theory
  3. Epistemology (Objectivity)
  4. Metaphysics
    1. Genetic Intelligibility
    2. Dialectical Intelligibility
    3. Radical Unintelligibility
  5. Methodology
  6. Categories
    1. Action, Concepts, and Method
    2. Good and Bad
    3. Better and Worse
    4. Authority and Power
    5. Principles and People
    6. Duties and Rights
  7. Summary
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Major Works of Lonergan
    2. Shorter Works Relevant to Ethics
    3. Other Works

1. Origins

Bernard Lonergan, a preeminent Canadian philosopher, theologian and economist, (1904-1984) was the principal architect of what he named a "generalized empirical method." Born in Buckingham, Quebec, Lonergan received a typical Catholic education and eventually entered the Society of Jesus (Jesuits), leading to his ordination to the priesthood in 1936. He specialized in both theology and economics at this time, having been deeply influenced by his doctoral work on Thomas Aquinas and by his long-standing interest in the philosophy of culture and history, honed by his reading of Hegel and Marx. In the early 1950s, while teaching theology in Toronto, Lonergan wrote Insight: A Study of Human Understanding - his groundbreaking philosophical work. Then, in the early 70s, he published his equally fundamental work, Method in Theology. Throughout his career, he lectured and wrote on topics related to theology, philosophy, and economics. The University of Toronto has undertaken the publication of The Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan, for which 20 volumes are projected.

Lonergan aimed to clarify what occurs in any discipline - science, math, historiography, art, literature, philosophy, theology, or ethics. The need for clarification about methods has been growing over the last few centuries as the world has turned from static mentalities and routines to the ongoing management of change. Modern languages, modern architecture, modern art, modern science, modern education, modern medicine, modern law, modern economics, the modern idea of history and the modern idea of philosophy all are based on the notion of ongoing creativity. Where older philosophies sought to understand unchanging essentials, logic and law were the rule. With the emergence of modernity, philosophies have turned to understanding the innate methods of mind by which scientists and scholars discover what they do not yet know and create what does not yet exist.

The success of the empirical methods of the natural sciences confirms that the mind reaches knowledge by an ascent from data, through hypothesis, to verification. To account for disciplines that deal with humans as makers of meanings and values, Lonergan generalized the notion of data to include the data of consciousness as well as the data of sense. From that compound data, one may ascend through hypothesis to verification of the operations by which humans deal with what is meaningful and what is valuable. Hence, a "generalized empirical method" (GEM).

Lonergan also referred to GEM as a critical realism. By realism, in line with the Aristotelian and Thomist philosophies, he affirmed that we make true judgments of fact and of value, and by critical, he aimed to ground knowing and valuing in a critique of the mind similar to that proposed by Kant.

GEM traces to their roots in consciousness the sources of the meanings and values that constitute personality, social orders, and historical developments. GEM also explores the many ways these meanings and values are distorted, identifies the elements that contribute to recovery, and proposes a framework for collaboration among disciplines to overcome these distortions and promote better living together.

These explorations are conducted in the manner of personal experiments. In Insight and Method in Theology, Lonergan leads readers to discover what happens when they reach knowledge, evaluate options, and make decisions. He expects that those who make these discoveries about themselves reach an explicit knowledge of how anyone reaches knowledge and values, how inquiries are guided by internal criteria, and how therefore any inquiry may be called "objective." Such objectivity implies structural parallels between the processes of inquiry and the structures of what any inquirer, in any place or time, can know and value. Lonergan proposes that these structures, in turn, provide a personally verified clarification of the methods specific to the natural and human sciences, historiography and hermeneutics, economics, aesthetics, theology, ethics, and philosophy itself.

So there are four questions, as it were, that GEM proposes for anyone seeking to ground the methods of any discipline. (1) A cognitional theory asks, "What do I do when I know?" It encompasses what occurs in our judgments of fact and value. (2) An epistemology asks, "Why is doing that knowing?" It demonstrates how these occurrences may appropriately be called "objective." (3) A metaphysics asks “What do I know when I do it?” It identifies corresponding structures of the realities we know and value. (4) A methodology asks, "What therefore should we do?" It lays out a framework for collaboration, based on the answers to the first three questions.

In the following sections, a review of how ethicists familiar with GEM deal with each of these four questions will reveal dimensions that directly affect one's method in ethics.

2. Cognitional Theory

GEM relies on a personal realization that we know in two different manners - commonsense and theoretical. In both we experience insights, which are acts of understanding. In the commonsense mode, we grasp how things are related to ourselves because we are concerned about practicalities, our interpersonal relations, and our social roles. In the theoretical mode, we grasp how things are related to each other because we want to understand the nature of things, such as the law of gravity in physics or laws of repression in psychology. Theoretical insights may not be immediately practical, but because they look at the always and everywhere, their practicality encompasses any brand of common sense with its preoccupation with the here and now.

The theoretical terms defined in GEM should not be confused with their commonsense usage. To take a basic distinction, GEM defines morality as the commonsense assessments and behaviors of everyday living and ethics as the theoretical constructs that shape morality.

Each mode of knowing has its proper criteria, although not everyone reputed to have either common sense or theoretical acumen can say what these criteria are. A recurring theme throughout Lonergan's opus is that the major impediment in theoretical pursuits is the assumption that understanding must be something like picturing. For example, mathematicians who blur understanding with picturing will find it difficult to picture how 0.999... can be exactly 1.000.... Now most adults understand that 1/3 = 0.333..., and that when you triple both sides of this equation, you get exactly 1.000… and 0.999…. But only those who understand that an insight is not an act of picturing but rather an act of understanding will be comfortable with this explanation. Among them are the physicists who understand what Einstein and Heisenberg discovered about subatomic particles and macroastronomical events - it is not by picturing that we know how they function but rather by understanding the data.

Lonergan also notes that philosophers who blur the difference between picturing and the theoretical modes of knowing will be confused about objectivity. When it comes to understanding how the mind knows, they typically picture a thinker in here and reality out there, and ask how one gets from in here to out there - failing to notice that it is not by any picture but by verifying one's understanding of data that the thinker already knows that he or she really thinks.

GEM's goal of a theory of cognition, therefore, is not a set of pictures. It is a set of insights into the data of cognitive activities, followed by a personal verification of those insights. In disciplines that study humans, GEM incorporates the moral dimension by addressing how we know values that lead to moral decisions. So, in GEM's model of the thinking and choosing person, consciousness has four levels - experience of data, understanding the data, judgment that one's understanding is correct, and decision to act on the resulting knowledge. These are referred to as levels of self-transcendence, meaning that they are the principal set of operations by which we transcend the solitary self and deal with the world beyond ourselves through our wonder and care.

GEM builds on these realizations by the further personal discovery of certain innate norms at each of the four levels. On the level of experience, our attention is prepatterned, shifting our focus, often desultorily, among at least seven areas of interest - biological, sexual, practical, dramatic, aesthetic, intellectual, and mystical. On the level of understanding, our intellects pursue answers to questions of why and how and what for, excluding irrelevant data and half-baked ideas. On the level of judgment, our reason tests that our understanding makes sense of experience. On the level of decision, our consciences make value judgments and will bother us until we conform our actions to these judgments. Lonergan names these four innate norming processes "transcendental precepts." Briefly expressed, they are: Be attentive, Be Intelligent, Be reasonable, and Be responsible. But these expressions are not meant as formulated rules; they are English words that point to the internal operating norms by which anyone transcends himself or herself to live in reality. GEM uses the term authenticity to refer to the quality in persons who follow these norms.

Any particular rules or principles or priorities or criteria we formulate about moral living stem ultimately from these unformulated, but pressing internal criteria for better and worse. Whether our formulations of moral stances are objectively good, honestly mistaken, or malevolently distorted, there are no more fundamental criteria by which we make moral judgments. Maxims, such as "Treat others as you want to be treated," cannot be ultimately fundamental, since it is not on any super-maxim that we selected this one. Nor do authorities provide us with our ultimate values, since there is no super-authority to name the authorities we ought to follow. Rather, we rely on the normative criteria of being attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible; howsoever they may have matured in us, by which we select all maxims and authorities.

GEM includes many other elements in this analysis, including the roles of belief and inherited values, the dynamics of feelings and our inner symbolic worlds, the workings of bias, the rejection of true value in favor of mere satisfaction, and the commitment to love rather than hate.

3. Epistemology (Objectivity)

GEM may be characterized as a systems approach that correlates the subject's operations of knowing and choosing to their corresponding objects. Hence it understands objectivity as a correlation between the subject's intentionality and the realities and values intended. A subject's intention of objectivity functions as an ideal to be continuously approached. That ideal may be defined as the totality of correct judgments, supported by understanding, and verified in experience. Because our knowledge and values are mostly inherited, objectivity is the intended cumulative product of all successful efforts to know what is truly so and appreciate what is truly good. Clearly, we never know everything real or appreciate everything good. But despite any shortfalls, this principal notion of objectivity - the totality of correct judgments -- remains the recurring desire and the universal goal of anyone who wonders. In GEM's correlation-based, theoretical definition, such objectivity is a progressively more intelligent, reasonable and responsible worldview. Briefly put, an objective worldview is the fruit of subjective authenticity.

Confusion about objectivity may be traced to confusion about knowing. GEM proposes that any investigator who realizes that knowing is a compound of experience, understanding, and judgment may also recognize a persistent tendency to reduce objectivity to only one of these components.

There is an experiential component of objectivity in the sheer givenness of data. In commonsense discourse, we imagine that what we experience through our five senses is really "out there." But we also may refer to what we think is true or good as really "out there." Unfortunately, such talk stifles curiosity about the criteria we use to come to this knowledge. Knowing reality is easily reduced to a mental look. Similarly, the notion of moral objectivity collapses into a property of objects, detached from occurrences in subjects, so that we deem certain acts or people as "objectively evil" or "objectively good," where “objectively” means “out there for anyone to see.” This naiveté about objectivity condenses the criteria regarding the morality of an act to what we picture, overlooking the meanings that the actors attach to the act.

Beyond this experiential component, which bows to the data as "objectively" given, there is a normative component, which bows to the inner norming processes to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible. When we let these norms have their way, we raise relevant questions, assemble a coherent set of insights, avoid rash judgments, and test whether our ideas make sense of the data. This normative component is not a property of objects; it is a property of subjects. We speak of it when we say, "You're not being objective" or “Objectively speaking, I say....” It guards us against wishful thinking and against politicizing what should be an impartial inquiry. Still, while this view incorporates the subject in moral assessments, some philosophers tend to collapse other aspects of objectivity into this subjective normativity. For them, thorough analysis, strict logic, and internal coherence are sufficient for objectivity. They propose their structural analyses not as hypotheses that may help us understand concrete experience correctly but as complete explanations of concrete realities. The morality of an act is determined by its coherence with implacable theory, suppressing further questions about actual cases that fall outside their conceptual schemes.

Beyond the experiential and normative components of objectivity, there is an absolute component, by which all inquiry bows to reality as it is. The absolute component lies in our intention to affirm what is true or good independent of the fact that we happen to affirm it. It is precisely what is absent when what we affirm as real or good is not real or good. The absolute component lies neither in the object alone nor the subject alone but in a linking of the two. It exists when the subject's normative operations correctly confirm that the given experiential data meet all the conditions to make the judgment that X is so or Y is good. As a correlation between objective data and subjective acts, it corresponds to Aristotle's understanding of truth as a relation between what we affirm and what really is so. Moralists who collapse knowing into judgment alone typically overlook the conditions set by experience and understanding that make most moral judgments provisional. The result is the dogmatist, out of touch with experience and incapable of inviting others to reach moral judgments by appeal to their understanding.

4. Metaphysics

In popular use, metaphysics suggests a cloud of speculations about invisible forces on our lives. Among philosophers, metaphysics is the science that identifies the basic concepts about the structures of reality. GEM not only identifies basic concepts, but also traces them to their sources in the subject. Thus, concepts issue from insights, and insights issue from questions, and questions have birthdates, parented by answers to previous generations of questions. Moreover, the so-called raw data are already shaped by the questions that occur to an inquirer. These questions, in turn, contain clues to their answers insofar as the insight we expect is related to the kind of judgment we expect. It could be a logical conclusion, a judgment of fact, a judgment that an explanation is correct, or a judgment of value.

Because these complexities of human wonder are part of reality, GEM's metaphysics encompasses the relationship between the processes that guide our wonder and the realities we wonder about. The assumption is that when they operate successfully, the processes of wonder form an integrated set isomorphic to the integral dimensions of reality. For example, the scientific movement from data to hypothesis to verification corresponds to Lonergan's view that knowing moves from experience to understanding to judgment, as well as to Aristotle's view that reality consists of potency, form, and act. In GEM, then, metaphysics comprises both the processes of knowing and the corresponding features of anything that can be known.

This metaphysics is latent but operative before it is conceptualized and named. People who consistently tackle the right question and sidestep the wrong ones already possess latent abilities to discern some structured features of the object of their inquiry. With moral questions, their heuristic anticipations show up as seemingly innate strategies: Don't chisel your moral principles in stone. Consider historical circumstances. A bright idea is not necessarily a right idea. And so forth.

Eventually, these canny men and women may conceptualize and name their latent metaphysics. Should they ask themselves how they ever learned to discern the difference between good thinking and bad thinking, they may look beneath what they think about and wonder how their thinking works. They may realize what GEM takes as fundamental: Any philosophy will rest upon the operative methods of cognitional activity, either as correctly conceived or as distorted by oversights and mistaken orientations. Then, insofar as they correctly understand their cognitional activity, they may begin to make their latent metaphysics explicit.

In the remainder of this article, some of Lonergan's metaphysical terms particularly relevant to ethics are highlighted in bold face.

When we expect to understand anything, our insights fall into two classes. We can understand things as they currently function, or we can understand things as they develop over time. Regarding things as they currently function, we may notice that we have both direct insights and "inverse" insights. These correspond to two different kinds of intelligibilities that may govern what we aim to understand. Lonergan's use of "intelligibility" here corresponds to what Aristotle referred to as "form" and what modern science calls "the nature of."

A classical intelligibility (corresponding to the "classical" scientific insights of Galileo, Newton and Bacon) is grasped by a direct insight into functional correlations among elements. We understand the phases of the moon, falling bodies, pushing a chair - any events that result necessarily from prior events, other things being equal. A statistical intelligibility is grasped by an inverse insight that there is no direct insight available. But while we often understand that many events cannot be functionally related to each other, we also may understand that an entire set of such events within a specific time and place will cluster about some average. For if any subset of events we consider random varies regularly from this average, we will look for regulating factors in this subset, governed by a classical intelligibility to be grasped through a direct insight. Statistical intelligibility, then, does not regard events resulting necessarily from prior events. It regards sets of events, in place P during time T, resulting under probability from multiple and shifting events.

This distinction affects moral appeals to a "natural law." For example, those who hold that artificial birth control is morally wrong typically appeal to a direct, functional relationship between intercourse and conception. However, the nature of this relationship is not one conception per intercourse but the probability of one conception for many acts of intercourse - a relationship of statistical intelligibility. If this is the nature of births, then the natural law allows that each single act of intercourse need not be open to conception.

Regarding things as they develop over time, there are two basic kinds of development, again based on the distinction between direct and inverse insights.

A genetic intelligibility is grasped by a direct insight into some single driving factor that keeps the development moving through developmental phases, such as found in developmental models of stars, plants, human intelligence, and human morality. A dialectical intelligibility is grasped by an inverse insight that there is no single driving factor that keeps the development moving. Instead, there are at least two driving factors that modify each other while simultaneously modifying the developing entity.

These anticipations are key to understanding moral developments. Inquiry into a general pattern of moral development will anticipate a straight-line, genetic unfolding of a series of stages. Inquiry into a specific, actual moral development will anticipate a dialectical unfolding wherein the drivers of development modify each other at every stage, whether improving or worsening.

a. Genetic Intelligibility

Genetic intelligibility is what we expect to grasp when we ask how new things emerge out of old. In this perspective, the metaphysical notion of potency takes on a particularly important meaning for ethics. Potency covers all the possibilities latent in given realities to become intelligible elements of higher systems. What distinguishes creative thinkers is not just their habit of finding uses in things others find useless. They expect that nature brings about improvements even without their help as, for example, when floating clouds of interstellar dust congeal into circulating planets or when damaged brains develop alternate circuits around scar tissue.

In this universe characterized by the potency for successive higher systems, the field of ethics extends to anything we can know. Hence, the "goodness" of the universe lies partly in its potentials for more intelligible organization. Human concern is an instance, indeed a most privileged instance, of a burgeoning universe. A sense of this kind of finality commands respect for whatever naturally comes to be even if no immediate uses come to mind.

An ethics whose field covers universal potentials will trace how morality is about allowing better. It means allowing not only the potentials of nature to reveal themselves but also a maximum freedom to the innate human imperative to do better. It means thinking of any moral option as essentially a choice between preventing and allowing the exercise of a pure desire for the better. Thus, the work of moral living is largely preventive - preventing our neurotic fixations or egotism from narrowing our horizons, preventing our loyalties from suppressing independent thinking, or preventing our mental impatience from abandoning the difficult path toward complete understanding. The rest feels less like work and more like allowing a natural exuberance to a moral creativity whose range has not been artificially narrowed by bias.

In contrast, a commonsense view of the universe imagines only the dimensions studied by physicists. The rule is simple: Any X either does or does not exist. Without this rule, scientists could never build up knowledge of what is and what is not. However, in cases like ourselves, where the universal potency for higher forms has produced responsible consciousness, this rule does not cover all possibilities. We also make the value judgments that some Xs should or should not exist. To recognize that the universe produces normative acts of consciousness is to recognize that the universe is more than a massive factual conglomeration. It is a self-organizing, dynamic and improving entity. Its moral character emerges most clearly with us, in raising moral objections when things get worse, in anticipating that any existing thing may potentially be part of something better, and, sadly, in acting against our better judgment.

Another key metaphysical element within the dynamism of reality toward fuller being is the notion of development. GEM rejects the mechanist view that counts on physics alone to explain the appearance of any new thing. It also rejects the vitalist view that pictures a wondrous life force driving everything from atoms, molecules, and cells, to psyches, minds and hearts. The reality of development, particularly moral development, involves a historical sequence of notions about better and worse. We inherit moral standards, subtract what we think is nonsense and add what we think makes sense. Our inheritance is likewise a sum of our previous generation's inheritance, what they subtracted from it and added to it. Any moral tradition is essentially a sequence of moral standards, each linked to the past by an impure inheritance and to the future by the bits added and subtracted by a present generation.

Not every tradition is a morally progressing sequence, of course, but those that make progress alternate between securing past gains and opening the door to future improvements. GEM names the routines that secure gains a higher system as integrator. It names the routines within the emerged system that open the door to a better system a higher system as operator. Within a developing moral tradition, value judgments perform the integrator functions, while value questions perform the operator functions. The integrating power of value judgments will be directly proportional to the absence of operator functions -- specifically, any further relevant value questions. So we regard some values as rock solid because no one has raised any significant questions about them. Value judgments that are provisional will function as limited integrators - limited, to be exact, to the extent that lingering value questions function as operators, scrutinizing value judgments for factual errors, misconceived theories, or bias in the investigator.

Feelings may function as either operators or integrators. As operators, they represent our initial response to possible values, moving us to pose value questions. As integrators they settle us in our value judgments as our psyches link our affects to an image of the valued object. Lonergan names this linkage of affect and image a symbol. (This is a term that identifies an event in consciousness; it is not to be confused with the visible flags and icons we also call "symbols.") The concrete, functioning symbols that suffuse our psyches can serve as integrator systems for how we view our social institutions, various classes of people, and our natural environment, making it easy for us to respond smoothly without having to reassess everything at every moment. Symbols can also serve as operators insofar as the affect-image pair may disturb our consciousness, alerting us to danger or confusion, and prompting the questions we pose about values.

Although the operators that improve a community's tradition involve the questions that occur to its members, not all questions function as operators. Some value questions are poorly expressed, even to ourselves. We experience disturbing symbols, but have yet to pose a value question in a way that actually results in a positive change. Some value questions are posed by biased investigators, which degrade a community's moral heritage. Only those individuals who pose the questions that actually add values or remove disvalues will function as operators in an improving tradition. What makes any tradition improve, then, is neither the number of cultural institutions, nor governmental support of the arts, nor legal protections for freedom of thought, nor freedom of religion. These support the operators, and need to be regulated as such. But the operators themselves are the questions raised by the men and women who put true values above mere satisfactions.

The same alternating dynamic is evident in the moral development of an individual. While psychotherapists expect that an individual's age is not a reliable measure of moral maturity, those who understand development as an alternation of operators and integrators may pose their questions about a patient's maturity much more precisely: How successfully did this person meet the sequence of operator questions at turning points in his or her life? And what are the resultant integrator symbols guiding this person today? Similarly, in theories of individual development, what counts is what the operators may be at any stage. Where some theorists only describe the various stages, GEM looks for an account of a prior stage as integrator that connects directly to the operator questions to which an emerging stage is an answer.

b. Dialectical Intelligibility

The foregoing genetic model of development gives a gross view of stages and a first approximation to actual development. But actual development is the bigger story. Who we are is a unique weaving of the mutual impacts of external challenges and our internal decisions. So we come to the kind of intelligibility that accounts for concrete historical growth or decline - dialectical intelligibility. We expect this kind of understanding when we anticipate a tension among drivers of development and changes in these very drivers, depending on the path that the actual development takes.

Friendship, for example, has been compared to a garden that needs tending, but the analogy is misleading. What we understand about gardens falls under genetic intelligibility. Seeds will produce their respective vegetables, fruits or flowers; all we do is provide the nutrients. In a friendship, however, each partner is changed with each compromise, accommodation, resistance or refusal. So the inner dynamic of any friendship is a concrete unfolding of two personalities, each linked to the other yet able to oppose the other.

A community, too, is a dialectical reality. Its members' perceptions, their patterns of behavior, their ways of collaborating and disputing, and all their shared purposes are the concrete result of three linked but opposed principles: their spontaneous intersubjectivity, their practical intelligence, and their values.

Spontaneous Intersubjectivity: Our spontaneous needs and wants constitute the primitive, intersubjective dimensions of community. We nest; we take to our kind; we share the unreflective social routines of the birds and bees, seeking one particular good after another.

Practical Intelligence: We also get insights into how to meet our needs and wants more efficiently. We design our houses to fit our circumstances and pay others to build them. In exchange, others pay us to make their bread, drive them to work, or care for their sick. Here is where the intelligent dimensions of a community emerge, comprising all the linguistic, technological, economic, political and social systems springing from human insight that constitute a society.

Values: Where practical intelligence sets up what a community does, values ground why they do it. Here is where the moral dimensions of community emerge - the shoulds and should-nots conveyed in laws, agreements, education, art, public opinion and moral standards. They embody all the commitments and priorities that constitute a culture.

These three principles are linked. Spontaneously, we pursue the particular goods that we need or want. Intellectually, we discover the technical, economic, political and social means to ensure the continuing flow of these particular goods, and we adapt our personal skills and habits to work within these systems. Morally, we decide whether the particular goods and the systems that deliver them actually improve our lives. Yet the principles are forever opposed. Insight often suppresses the urges of passion, while passion unmoored from insight would carry us along its undertow. Conscience, meanwhile, passes judgment on both our choices of particular goods and the systems we set up to keep them coming.

A dialectical anticipation regards a community as a moving, concrete resultant of the mutual conditioning of these three principles. When spontaneous intersubjectivity dominates a community, its members' intellects are deformed by animal passion. When practical intelligence ignores spontaneous intersubjectivity, a society becomes stratified into an elite with its grand plans and a proletariat living from hand to mouth. Where members prefer mere satisfactions over values, intelligences are biased, and deeper human needs for authenticity are ignored. In any case, communities move, pushed and pulled by these principles, now converging toward, now diverting away from genuine progress.

c. Radical Unintelligibility

The idea of development implies a lack of intelligibility, namely, the intelligibility yet to be realized. Likewise, there is a lack of intelligibility in the distorted socio-cultural institutions and self-defeating personal habits that pose the everyday problems confronting us. Yet even these are intelligibly related to the events that created them.

What lacks intelligibility it itself, however, is the refusal to make a decision that one deems one ought to make. GEM follows the Christian tradition of the apostle Paul, of Augustine, and of Aquinas in recognizing the phenomenon that we can act against our better judgment. This tradition is aware that much wrongdoing results from coercion, or conditioning, or invincible ignorance, but it asserts nonetheless that we can refuse to choose what we know is worth choosing. Lonergan refers to these events as "basic sin" to distinguish them from the effects of such refusals on one's socio-cultural institutions and personal habits. Their unintelligibility is radical, in the sense that a deliberate refusal to obey a dictate of one's deliberation cannot be explained, even if, as often happens, later deliberation dictates something else. It is radical also in the etymological sense of a root that branches into the actions, habits and institutions that we consider "bad."

5. Methodology

Different media subdivide ethics in different ways. News media divide it according to the positions people take on moral issues. Many college textbooks divide it into three related disciplines: metaethics (methods), normative ethics (principles), and applied ethics (case studies). This division implies that we first settle issues of method, then establish general moral principles, and finally apply those principles straightaway into practice. GEM proposes that moral development is not the straight line of genetic development nourished solely by principles but rather a dialectical interplay of spontaneous intersubjectivity, practical intelligence, and values. So, instead of a deductive, three-step division of moral process, GEM expects moral reflection to spiral forward inductively, assessing new situations with new selves at every turn. The question then becomes how ethicists might collaborate in wending the way into the future.

In his Method in Theology, Lonergan grouped the processes by which theology reflects on religion into eight specializations, each with functional relationships to the other seven. As illustrated in the chart below, the four levels of human self-transcendence - being attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible – function in the two phases of understanding the past and planning for the future. Thus, we learn about the past by moving upward through research, interpretation, history, and a dialectical evaluation. We move into the future by moving downward through foundational commitments, basic doctrines, systematic organizations of doctrines, and communication of the resulting meanings and values. Our future slips into our past soon enough, and the process continues, turn after turn, reversing or advancing the forces of decline, meeting ever new challenges or buckling under the current ones.

While Lonergan presented this view primarily to meet problems in theology, he extended the notion of functional specialties to ethics, historiography and the human sciences by associating doctrines, systematics, and communications with policies, plans and implementations, respectively. These eight functional specialties are not distinct professions or separate university departments. They represent Lonergan's grouping of the operations of mind and heart by which we actually do better. That is, he is not suggesting a recipe for better living; he is proposing a theoretical explanation of how the mind and heart work whenever we actually improve life, along with a proposal for collaboration in light of this explanation.

lonergan-fig

The bottom three rows of functions will be initially familiar to anyone involved in practically any enterprise. The top row of functions is less familiar, but it represents Lonergan's clarification of the evaluative moments that occur in any collaboration that improves human living.

The functional specialty dialectic occurs when investigators explicitly sort out and evaluate the basic elements in any human situation. They evaluate the data of research, the explanations of interpreters, and the accounts of historians. To ensure that all the relevant questions are met, they bring together different people with different evaluations with a view to clarifying and resolving any differences that may appear.

From a GEM perspective, the most radical differences result from the presence or absence of conversion. Three principal types have been identified. There is an intellectual conversion by which a person has personally met the challenges of a cognitional theory, an epistemology, a metaphysics, and a methodology. There is a moral conversion by which a person is committed to values above mere satisfactions. And there is an affective conversion by which a person relies on the love of neighbor, community, and God to heal bias and prioritize values.

By attending to these radical differences, GEM rejects the typical liberal assumption that (1) people always lie, cheat and steal; (2) realistically, nothing can be done about these moral shortcomings; and (3) social institutions can do no more than balance conflicting interests. This assumption constricts moral vision to a pragmatism that may look promising in the short run but fails to deal with the roots of moral shortcomings in the long run. Dialectic occurs when investigators explicitly deal with each other's intellectual, moral and affective norms, under the assumption that converted horizons are objectively better than unconverted horizons.

The functional specialty foundations occurs when investigators make their commitments and make them explicit. Relying on the evaluations and mutual encounters that occur in the specialty, dialectic, investigators deliberately select the horizons and commitments upon which they base any proposed improvements. These foundations are expressed in explanatory categories insofar as investigators make explicit their latent metaphysics and the horizons opened by their intellectual, moral and affective conversions.

Regarding ethics, investigators use a number of categories to formulate ethical systems, to track developments, to propose moral standards, and to express specific positions on issues. By way of illustration below, there are six sets of categories that seem particularly important: (1) action, concepts and method, (2) good and bad, (3) better and worse, (4) authority and power, (5) principles and people, and (6) duties and rights.

While commonsense discourse uses these terms descriptively, GEM's theoretical approach defines them as correlations between subjective operations and their objective correlatives. An ethics based on GEM assumes that if science is to take seriously the data of consciousness, then it is necessary to deal explicitly with the normative elements that make consciousness moral. Because these subjective operations include moral norms and because their objective correlatives involve concrete values, the categories will not be empirically indifferent. Their power to support explanations of moral situations and proposals will derive from normative elements in their definitions, which, in turn are openly grounded in the innate norms to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible.

6. Categories

a. Action, Concepts, and Method

Interest in method may be considered as a third plateau in humanity's progressive enlargement of what has become meaningful.

  • A first plateau regards action. What is meaningful is practicality, technique, and palpable results.
  • A second plateau regards concepts. What counts are the language, the logic, and the conceptual systems that give a higher and more permanent control over action.
  • The third plateau regards method. As modern disciplines shift from fixed conceptual systems to the ongoing management of change, the success of any conceptual system depends on a higher control over its respective methods.

Morality initially regards action, but it has expanded into a variety of conceptual systems under the heading of ethics. It is these systems, and their associated categories, which are the focus of the third-plateau methodological critique. On the third plateau, concepts lose their rigidity. As long as investigators are explicit about their cognitional theory, epistemology and metaphysics, they will continually refine or replace concepts developed in previous historical contexts.

Although the second plateau emerged from the first and the third is currently emerging from the second, GEM anticipates that any investigator today may be at home with action only, with both action and concepts, or with action, concepts, and method. The effort of foundations is for investigators to include all three plateaus in their investigations. The effort of dialectic is to invite all dialog partners to do the same.

b. Good and Bad

Where second-plateau minds would typically name things good or bad insofar as they fall under preconceived concepts such as heroism or murder, liberation or oppression, philanthropy or robbery, third-plateau minds look to concrete assessments of situations. To ensure that this assessment is sufficiently grounded in theory, GEM requires an understanding of certain correlations between intentional acts and their objects. This requires more than a notional assent to concepts; it requires personally verified insight into what minds and hearts intend and how they intend it.

The relevant correlations that constitute anything called bad or good may be viewed according to the three levels of intentionality that dialectically shape any community. (1) Spontaneously, our interests, actions and passions intend particular goods. (2) Intelligently and reasonably, our insights and judgments intend the vast, interlocking set of systems that give us these particular goods regularly. (3) Responsibly and affectively, our decisions and loves intend what is truly worthwhile among these particular goods and the systems that deliver them.

In authentic persons, affectivity and responsibility shape reasonable and intelligent operations, which in turn govern otherwise spontaneous interests, actions and passions. This hierarchy in intentionality correlates with a priority of cultural values over social systems, and social systems over the ongoing particular activities of a populace. Thus, GEM regards human intelligence and reason as at the service of moral and affective orientations. This turns upside down the view of "materialistic" economic and educational institutions that dedicate intelligence and reason to serving merely spontaneous interests, actions, and passions.

At the same time, moral and affective orientations rely on intelligent and reasonable analyses of situations to produce moral precepts - an approach that contrasts with ethics that look chiefly to virtue and good will for practical guidance. Lonergan demonstrated how intelligent and reasonable analyses produce moral precepts in his works on the economy (Macroeconomic Dynamics: An Essay in Circulation Analysis) and on marriage ("Finality, Love, Marriage").

So GEM regards the concepts of good and bad as useful for expressing moral conclusions, provide they are rooted in intelligent analysis, dialectical encounter, and personal conversion. GEM relies on dialectical encounter to expose the oversights when "good" and "bad" are used to categorize actions in the abstract.

c. Better and Worse

The complexities of one's situation involve not only its history, but the views of history embraced by its participants. Darwinian, Hegelian and Marxist views of history are largely genetic, insofar as they support the liberal thesis that life automatically improves, and that wars, disease, and economic crashes are necessary steps in the forward march of history. GEM declares an end to this age of scientific innocence. It regards this thesis of progress as simply a first of three successively more thorough approximations toward a full understanding of actual situations. A second approximation takes in the working of bias and the resulting dynamics of historical decline. A third approximation takes in the factors of recovery by which bias and its objective disasters may be reversed.

First Approximation: What drives progress. We experience a situation and feel the impulse to improve it. We spot what's missing, or some overlooked potentials. We express our insight to others, getting their validation or refinement. We make a plan and put it into effect. The situation improves, bringing us back to feeling yet further impulses to improve things. The odds of spotting new opportunities grow as, with each turn of the cycle, more and more of what doesn't make sense is replaced by what does. Such is the nature of situations that improve.

Second Approximation: What drives decline. Again, we experience a situation and an impulse to improve it. But we do not, or will not, spot what's missing. We express our oversight to others, making it out to be an insight. If they lack any critical eye, they take us at our word rather than notice our oversight. We make a plan, put it into effect, and discover later the inevitable worsening of the situation. Now the odds of spotting ways to improve things decrease, owing to the additional complexity and cross-purposes of the anomalies. With each turn of the cycle, less and less makes sense. Such is the nature of situations that worsen.

Lonergan proposed that such oversights might be rooted in any of four biases endemic to consciousness: (1) Neurosis resists insight into one's psyche. (2) Egoism resists insight into what benefits others. (3) Loyalism resists insights into the good of other groups. (4) Anti-intellectualism resists insights that require any thorough investigation, theory-based analyses, long-range planning, and broad implementation. In each type, one's intelligence is selectively suppressed and one’s self-image is supported by positive affects that reinforce the bias and by negative affects toward threats to the bias.

Third Approximation: What drives recovery. GEM offers an analysis of love to show how it functions to reverse the dynamics of decline.

  • Love liberates the subject to see values: Some values result not from logical analyses of pros and cons but rather from being in love. Love impels friends of the neurotic and egoist to draw them out of their self-concern, freeing their intelligence to consider the value of more objective solutions. Love of humanity frees loyalists to regard other groups with the same intelligence, reason and responsibility as they do their own. Love of humanity frees the celebrated person of common sense to appreciate the more comprehensive viewpoints of critical history, science, philosophy and theology. Love of a transcendent, unreservedly loving God frees a person from blinding hatred, greed and power mongering, liberating him or her to a divinely shared commitment to what is unreservedly intelligible, reasonable, responsible and loving.
  • Love brings hope: There is a power in the human drama by which we cling to some values no matter how often our efforts are frustrated. Our hopes may be dashed, but we still hope. This hope is a desire rendered confident by love. Those who are committed to self-transcendence trust their love to strengthen their resolve, not only to act against the radical unintelligibility of basic sin, but also to yield their personal advantage for the sake of the common good. Such love-based hope works directly against biased positive self-images as well as negative images of fate that give despair the last word. To feel confident about the order we hope for, we do not look to theories or logic. We rely on the symbols that link our imagination and affectivity. These inner symbols are secured through the external media of aesthetics, ritual, and liturgy.
  • Love opposes revenge: There is an impulse in us to take an eye for an eye, a tooth for a tooth. While any adolescent can see that this strategy cannot be the foundation of a civil society, it is difficult to withhold vengeance on those who harm us. It is the nature of love, however, to resist hurting others and to transcend vengeance. It is because of such transcendent love that we move beyond revenge to forgiveness and beyond forgiveness to collaboration.

GEM's perspective on moral recovery aims to help historians and planners understand how any situation gets better or worse. It helps historians locate the causes of problems in biases as opposed to merely deploring the obvious results. It helps planners propose solutions based on the actual drivers of progress and recovery, as opposed to mere cosmetic changes.

d. Authority and Power

Common sense typically thinks of authority as the people in power. GEM roots the meaning of authority in the normative functions of consciousness and defines the expression of authority in terms of legitimate power.

An initial meaning of power is physical, and physical power is multiplied by collaboration. But in the world of social institutions, a normative meaning of power emerges - the power produced by insights and value judgments. Insights are expressed in words; words raise questions of value; judgments of value lead to decisions; decisions result in cooperation; and this kind of cooperation vastly reduces the physical power needed while achieving vastly better results. The social power of a community grows as it consolidates the gains of the past, restricts behaviors that would diminish the community's effectiveness, organizes labors for specific tasks, and spells out moral guidelines for the future. As normative, the memory and commitments involved in this heritage constitute a community's "word of authority."

The community appoints "authorities" to implement these tasks. Authorities are the spokespersons, delegates, and caretakers of a community's spiritual and material assets. Winning the vote does not confer an authority upon them; it confers a responsibility upon them to speak and embody the community's word of authority. The honor owed to them by titles and ceremony does not derive from any virtue of their persons but rather from the honorable heritage and common purpose with which they have been entrusted.

While the community's social power resides in its ways and means, not all its ways and means are legitimate. A community’s heritage is a mixed bag of sense and nonsense. To the extent that authorities lack the authenticity of being attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible, their power to build up is diminished. Even if everyone does what they say, inauthentic authorities will be blind to the higher viewpoints and better ideas needed to stave off chaos and seize opportunities for improving life together. Their power is justifiably called naked because it is stripped of the intelligent, reasonable, and responsible contributions their subjects are quite capable of making. Similarly, to the extent that the subjects lack authenticity, they will cripple their own creativity, which otherwise would foresee problems, overcome obstacles, and open new lines of development. At the extremes, a noble leader of egotistical followers has no more effective power than an egotistical leader of noble followers. Between these extremes, the typical dynamic is an ongoing dialectic between an incomplete authenticity of the community and an incomplete authenticity of its authorities.

In this concrete perspective, GEM defines authority as power legitimated by authenticity. That is, authority is that portion of a heritage produced by attention, intelligence, reason, and responsibility. As only a portion of a heritage, authority is a dialectical reality, to be worked out in mutual encounter, rather than a dictatorial iron law (a classical reality), an anarchical or libertarian social order (a statistical reality), or a natural, evolutionary dynasty (a genetic reality).

This definition of authority as the power legitimated by authenticity offers historians defensible explanations for their distinctions between legitimate and illegitimate exercises of power within a historical period. It offers policymakers the normative categories they need to explain to their constituents the reasons for proposed changes in the community's constitution, laws, and sanctions. It reminds authorities that they have been entrusted with the maintenance and refinement of a heritage created by the community.

e. Principles and People

A commonsense use of "moral principles" usually means any set of conceptualized standards, such as, “The punishment should fit the crime" or "First, do no harm.”

When ethicists consider how moral principles should be used, disagreements arise. Some scorn them because principles are only abstract generalizations that do not apply in concrete situations. When we try to apply them, disputes arise about the meaning of terms such as "crime" or "harm." Particular cases always require further value judgments on the relative importance of mitigating factors, which generalizations omit. What counts is a thorough assessment of the concrete situation, which will result in an intuition of what seems best.

Others reject such situation-based ethics because people have different intuitions about what seems best in particular situations. What is needed is a general principle that supports the common good. Moreover, history proves that formulated principles are good things. Because they represent wisdom gained by others who met threats to their well being, to neglect them is to unknowingly expose oneself to the same threats. We codify principles in our laws, appeal to them in our debates, and teach them to our children. For children in particular, and for adults whose moral intelligence has not matured, principles are firm anchors in a stormy sea.

GEM regards principles as concepts that need the critique of a third-plateau reflection on the methods used to develop them. They are not really principles in the sense of starting points. That is, they are not the source of normative demands. The actual sources of normative demands are self-transcending people being attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible. Formulated principles are the products of people shaped by an ambiguous heritage, exposed to a dialectic of opinions, and directed by personal commitments within intellectual, moral and affective horizons. These horizons may complement each other; they may develop from earlier stages; or they may be dialectically opposed, as when people who mouth the same principles attach opposite meanings to them, or when people espouse the principle but act otherwise.

GEM grants no exception for moral principles proposed by religions. A religious revelation is considered neither a delivery from the sky of inscribed tablets nor a dictation heard from unseen divinities. In its data of consciousness perspective, GEM considers revelation as a person's judgment of value regarding known proposals, whether inscribed or spoken or imagined. Its religious sanction is based on a person's claim that this judgment is prompted by a transcendent love from a transcendent source in his or her heart.

Those who formulate specific moral principles need to understand that there are distinct methodological issues associated with each of the eight specialties that form a group in consciousness. This understanding begins with men and women who think about their intellectual, moral and affective commitments in explanatory categories (foundations). It is first expressed in these categories as judgments of fact or value (doctrines/policies). It expands through understanding the relationships these principles have with other principles (systematics/planning). It becomes effective thorough adaptations that take into account the current worldview of a community, the media used, and the values implicit in the community's language (communications/implementation). These adaptations become data (research) for further understanding (interpretation) within historical contexts (history) to be evaluated (dialectic.)

GEM's strategy for resolving differences among principles is to exercise the functional specialty dialectic to reveal their true source. Investigators evaluate not only the historical accounts of how any principle arose, but also the principle itself. GEM proposes that where investigators overcome disagreements, the parties have lain open their basic horizons, particularly the intellectual, moral and affective horizons that reveal the radical grounds of disagreements and agreements. In this mutual encounter, people concerned about morality are already familiar with normative elements in their consciousness and may only lack the insights and language to make them intelligible parts of how they present their views. The strategy is not to prove one's principle or disprove another's but to tap one another's experience of a desire for authenticity. GEM counts on the probability that those people with more effective intellectual, moral and affective horizons will, by laying bare the roots of any differences, attract and guide those whose horizons are less effective.

Besides people who appreciate authenticity, there are people who crave its opposite, as the history of hatred amply demonstrates. If GEM has accurately identified the dialectic of decline as driven by an increasingly degraded authenticity, with its increasingly narrow and unconnected solutions to problems, then the reversal of moral evil must appeal to any remnants of authenticity in the hater. The appeal involves enlargements of horizons at many levels. For communities of hatred, this enlargement will require moving from legends about their heritage to a critical history, revising the rhetoric and rituals that secure commitment, and rewriting their laws. At the same time, there is also an enlargement to be expected of the communities who seek to convert communities of hatred. This is because more comprehensive political protocols and moral standards will be required to achieve a yet higher integration of those portions of both heritages that resulted from authenticity.

f. Duties and Rights

In the perspective of GEM, the elemental meaning of duty is found in the originating set of "oughts" in the impulses to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable, and responsible, plus the overriding "ought" to maintain consistency between what one knows and how one acts. The oughts issued by conscience not only provide all the norms expressed in written rules, but also issue far more commands and prohibitions than parents, police, and public policy ever could. It is this inner duty that enables one to break from a minor authenticity that obeys the written rule and to exercise a major authenticity that may expose a written rule as illegitimate.

At first glance, the GEM view of morality may appear sympathetic to "deontological" theories that base all moral obligation on duty rather than consequences. While it is true that GEM traces all specific obligations to an underlying, universal duty, it goes deeper than concept-based maxims by identifying the dynamic originating duty in every person to be attentive, intelligent, reasonable and responsible. By tracing the source of any maxims about duty to their historical origins, GEM leaves open the possibility that new historical circumstances may require new maxims.

Moreover, insofar as any formulations of duty are consequences of past historical situations, and as new formulations will be consequences of new situations, GEM supports the consideration of consequences in ethical theory. What this approach adds, however, is the requirement that all consequences pass under the scrutiny of dialectic, which aims to filter merely satisfying consequences from the truly valuable, and to consider how specific consequences contribute to historical progress, decline, or recovery. These consequences include not only changes in observable behaviors and social standards but also any shifts in the intellectual, moral and affective horizons of a community.

As adults juggle their customary duties to social norms and their originating duty to be authentic, many discover that the best parts of these social norms arose from the authenticity of forebears. With this discovery comes a recognition of a present duty to preserve those portions of one's heritage based on authenticity, to critique those portions based on bias, and to create the social and economic institutions that facilitate authenticity.

Lonergan depicted such preservation, critique, and creativity as an ongoing experiment of history. The success of the race, and of any particular peoples, depends on collaborative efforts to conduct this experiment rather than serve as its guinea pigs. Collaboration, in turn, requires authenticity of all collaborators.

Any collaboration that successfully makes life more intelligible will require a freedom to speak one's mind, to associate, to maintain one's health, and to be educated. The notion of human rights, therefore, is a derivative of this intelligibility intrinsic to nourishing a heritage. While "rights" usually appear as one-way demands by one party upon others, their essential meaning is that they are expressions of the mutual demands intrinsic to any collaborative process aimed at improving life. Any individual's claim in the name of rights is essentially an assumption that others will honor his or her duty to contribute to the experiment to improve a common heritage.

Conflicts of rights are often the ordinary conflicts involved in any compromise. More seriously, they may be differences between plateaus of meaning among a community's members. First-plateau minds, focused on action, will think of rights as the behaviors and entitlements that lawmakers allow to citizens. Many will conclude that they have a right to do wrong. In contrast, GEM views lawmakers as responsible for protecting the liberty of citizens to live authentically. Thus, while the law lets every dog have a free bite, GEM repudiates the conclusion that anyone has a right to do wrong.

Second-plateau minds promote the ancient and honorable notion that rights are a set of immutable, universal properties of human nature. GEM considers that the strength of the modern notion of rights has been based mainly on logical consistency and permanent validity. However, from the methods perspective of the third plateau of meaning, GEM also recovers elements in the ancient notion of natural right that include personal authenticity and defines these elements in terms of personal conversion. On that basis, GEM proposes a collaborative superstructure driven by the functional specialties, dialectic and foundations.

In any case, GEM considers rights as historically conditioned means for authentic ends. As historically conditioned means, rights may take any number of legal and social forms. So, for example, the historical expansion from civil rights (speech, assembly, suffrage) to social rights (work, education, health care), to group rights (women, homosexuals, ethnic groups) is evidence of the ongoing emergence of new kinds of claims on each other's duty to replenish a heritage. As oriented toward authentic ends, the validity of any rights claim depends on how well it enables authentic living, a question addressed through the mutual exposures that occur in the functional specialty dialectic. Consequently, ethicists familiar with GEM rely less on the language of rights and more on the language of dialog, encounter, and heritage.

7. Summary

A generalized empirical method in ethics clarifies the subject's operations regarding values. The effort relies on a personal appropriation of what occurs when making value judgments, on a discovery of innate moral norms, and on a grasp of the meaning of moral objectivity. These innate methods of moral consciousness are expressed in explanatory categories, to be used both for conceptualizing for oneself what occurs regarding value judgments and for expressing to others the actual grounds for one's value positions.

GEM is based on a gamble that the odds of genuine moral development are best when the players lay these intellectual, moral and affective cards on the table. Concretely, this implies a duty to acknowledge the historicity of one's moral views as well as a readiness to admit oversights in one's self-knowledge. Moreover, given the proliferation of moral issues that affect confronting cultures with different histories today, it also implies a duty to meet the stranger in a place where this openness can occur.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Main Works of Lonergan

  • Insight: A Study of Human Understanding. Volume 3 of the Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1997. Originally published 1957.
  • Method in Theology. New York: Herder & Herder, 1972.
  • "Cognitional Structure," Collection. Montreal: Palm, 1967, pp 221-239.
  • "Dimensions of Meaning," Ibid., pp 252-267.
  • "The Subject," A Second Collection. London: Darton, Longman & Todd, 1974, pp. 69-87.
  • Macroeconomic Dynamics: An Essay in Circulation Analysis. Volume 15 of the Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1999.

b. Shorter Works Relevant to Ethics

  • "Finality, Love, Marriage." Collection, op. cit., pp 16-55.
  • "The Example of Gibson Winter," A Second Collection, op. cit., pp 189-192.
  • "The Dialectic of Authority," A Third Collection. New York: Paulist Press, 1985, pp 5-12.
  • "Method: Trend and Variations," ibid., pp 13-22.
  • "Healing and Creating in History," ibid., pp. 100-109.
  • "The Ongoing Genesis of Methods," ibid., pp. 146-165.
  • "Natural Right and Historical Mindedness," ibid., pp. 169-183.
  • "Lectures on Existentialism," Part Three of Phenomenology and Logic: The Boston College Lectures on Mathematical Logic and Existentialism, Volume 18 of the Collected Works of Bernard Lonergan, op.cit., pp. 219-317.

c. Other Works

  • Melchin, Kenneth R. Living with Other People. Ottawa: St. Paul University Press, 1998.
  • Morelli, Mark D. and Morelli, Elizabeth A. The Lonergan Reader. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1997.

Author Information

Tad Dunne
Email: tdunne@sienaheights.edu
U. S. A.

Martin Luther (1483—1546)

lutherGerman theologian, professor, pastor, and church reformer.  Luther began the Protestant Reformation with the publication of his Ninety-Five Theses on October 31, 1517.  In this publication, he attacked the Church’s sale of indulgences.  He advocated a theology that rested on God’s gracious activity in Jesus Christ, rather than in human works.  Nearly all Protestants trace their history back to Luther in one way or another.  Luther’s relationship to philosophy is complex and should not be judged only by his famous statement that “reason is the devil’s whore.”

Given Luther’s critique of philosophy and his famous phrase that philosophy is the “devil’s whore,” it would be easy to assume that Luther had only contempt for philosophy and reason. Nothing could be further from the truth. Luther believed, rather, that philosophy and reason had important roles to play in our lives and in the life of the community. However, he also felt that it was important to remember what those roles were and not to confuse the proper use of philosophy with an improper one.

Properly understood and used, philosophy and reason are a great aid to individuals and society. Improperly used, they become a great threat to both. Likewise, revelation and the gospel when used properly are an aid to society, but when misused also have sad and profound implications.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Theology
    1. Theological Background: William of Occam
    2. Theology of the Cross
    3. The Law and the Gospel
    4. Deus Absconditus – The Hidden God
  3. Relationship to Philosophy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Martin Luther was born to peasant stock on November 10, 1483 in Eisleben in the Holy Roman Empire – in what is today eastern Germany.  Soon after Luther’s birth, his family moved from Eisleben to Mansfeld. His father was a relatively successful miner and smelter and Mansfeld was a larger mining town. Martin was the second son born to Hans and Magarete (Lindemann) Luther. Two of his brothers died during outbreaks of the plague.  One other brother, James, lived to adulthood.

Luther’s father knew that mining was a cyclical occupation, and he wanted more security for his promising young son.  Hans Luther decided that he would do whatever was necessary to see that Martin could become a lawyer. Hans saw to it that Martin started school in Mansfeld probably around seven. The school stressed Latin and a bit of logic and rhetoric.  When Martin was 14 he was sent to Magdeburg to continue his studies. He stayed only one year in Magdeburg and then enrolled in Latin school in Eisenach until 1501. In 1501 he enrolled in the University of Erfurt where he studied the basic course for a Master of Arts (grammar, logic, rhetoric, metaphysics, etc.). Significant to his spiritual and theological development was the principal role of William of Occam’s theology and metaphysics in Erfurt’s curriculum. In 1505, it seemed that Han’s Luther’s plans were about to finally be realized.  His son was on the verge of becoming a lawyer.  Han’s Luther’s plans were interrupted by a thunderstorm and vow.

In July of 1505, Martin was caught in a horrific thunderstorm.  Afraid that he was going to die, he screamed out a vow, “Save me, St. Anna, and I shall become a monk.” St. Anna was the mother of the Virgin Mary and the patron saint of miners. Most argue that this commitment to become a monk could not have come out of thin air and instead represents an intensification experience in which an already formulated thought is expanded and deepened. On July 17th Luther entered the Augustinian Monastery at Erfurt.

The decision to enter the monastery was a difficult one. Martin knew that he would greatly disappoint his parents (which he did), but he also knew that one must keep a promise made to God. Beyond that, however, he also had strong internal reasons to join the monastery. Luther was haunted by insecurity about his salvation (he describes these insecurities in striking tones and calls them Anfectungen or Afflictions.) A monastery was the perfect place to find assurance.

Assurance evaded him however. He threw himself into the life of a monk with verve. It did not seem to help. Finally, his mentor told him to focus on Christ and him alone in his quest for assurance. Though his anxieties would plague him for still years to come, the seeds for his later assurance were laid in that conversation.

In 1510, Luther traveled as part of delegation from his monastery to Rome (he was not very impressed with what he saw.) In 1511, he transferred from the monastery in Erfurt to one in Wittenberg where, after receiving his doctor of theology degree, he became a professor of biblical theology at the newly founded University of Wittenberg.

In 1513, he began his first lectures on the Psalms.  In these lectures, Luther’s critique of the theological world around him begins to take shape. Later, in lectures on Paul’s Epistle to the Romans (in 1515/16) this critique becomes more noticeable. It was during these lectures that Luther finally found the assurance that had evaded him for years. The discovery that changed Luther’s life ultimately changed the course of church history and the history of Europe.  In Romans, Paul writes of the “righteousness of God.” Luther had always understood that term to mean that God was a righteous judge that demanded human righteousness. Now, Luther understood righteousness as a gift of God’s grace. He had discovered (or recovered) the doctrine of justification by grace alone. This discovery set him afire.

In 1517, he posted a sheet of theses for discussion on the University’s chapel door. These Ninety-Five Theses set out a devastating critique of the church’s sale of indulgences and explained the fundamentals of justification by grace alone. Luther also sent a copy of the theses to Archbishop Albrecht of Mainz calling on him to end the sale of indulgences. Albrecht was not amused. In Rome, cardinals saw Luther’s theses as an attack on papal authority. In 1518 at a meeting of the Augustinian Order in Heidelberg, Luther set out his positions with even more precision. In the Heidelberg Disputation, we see the signs of a maturing in Luther’s thought and new clarity surrounding his theological perspective – the Theology of the Cross.

After the Heidelberg meeting in October 1518, Luther was told to recant his positions by the Papal Legate, Thomas Cardinal Cajetan. Luther stated that he could not recant unless his mistakes were pointed out to him by appeals to “scripture and right reason” he would not, in fact, could not recant. Luther’s refusal to recant set in motion his ultimate excommunication.

Throughout 1519, Luther continued to lecture and write in Wittenberg. In June and July of that year, he participated in another debate on Indulgences and the papacy in Leipzig. Finally, in 1520, the pope had had enough. On June 15th the pope issued a bull (Exsurge Domini – Arise O’Lord) threatening Luther with excommunication. Luther received the bull on October 10th. He publicly burned it on December 10th.

In January 1521, the pope excommunicated Luther.  In March, he was summonsed by Emperor Charles V to Worms to defend himself. During the Diet of Worms, Luther refused to recant his position. Whether he actually said, “Here I stand, I can do no other” is uncertain. What is known is that he did refuse to recant and on May 8th was placed under Imperial Ban.

This placed Luther and his duke in a difficult position. Luther was now a condemned and wanted man. Luther hid out at the Wartburg Castle until May of 1522 when he returned to Wittenberg. He continued teaching. In 1524, Luther left the monastery. In 1525, he married Katharina von Bora.

From 1533 to his death in 1546 he served as the Dean of the theology faculty at Wittenberg. He died in Eisleben on 18 February 1546.

2. Theology

a. Theological Background: William of Occam

The medieval worldview was rational, ordered, and synthetic. Thomas Aquinas embodied it. It survived until the acids of war, plague, poverty, and social discord began to eat away its underlying presupposition – that the world rested on the being of God.

All of life was grounded in the mind of God. In the hierarchy of Being that establishes justice, the church was understood as the connection between the secular and divine. However, as the crises of the late middle ages increased, this reassurance no longer assuaged.

William of Occam recognized the shortcomings of Thomas’s system and cut away most of the ontological grounding of existence. In its place, Occam posited revelation and covenant. The world does not need to be grounded in some artificial, unknowable, ladder of Being.  Instead, one must rely on God’s faithfulness. We are contingent upon God alone.

This contingency would be terrible and unbearable without the assurance of God’s covenant. In terms of God’s absolute power (potentia absoluta), God can do anything.  He can make a lie the truth, he can make adultery a virtue and monogamy a vice. The only limit to this power is consistency—God cannot contradict his own essence. To live in a world ordered by whim would be terrible; one would never know if one was acting justly or unjustly. However, God has decided on a particular way of acting (potentia ordinata). God has covenanted with creation, and committed himself to a particular way of acting.

While rejecting some of Thomas, Occam did not reject the entire scholastic project.  He, too, synthesized and depended heavily upon Aristotle. This dependence becomes significant in the covenantal piety of justification. The fundamental question of justification is where does one find fellowship with God, i.e., how does one know one is accepted by God?  The logic of Aristotle taught Thomas and Occam that “like is known by like.”  Thus, union or fellowship with God must take place on God’s level. How does this happen? Practice.

All people are born, it was argued, with potential. Even though all creation suffers under the condemnation of the Fall of Adam and Eve, there remains a divine spark of potentiality, a syntersis. This potential must be actualized. It must be habituated. Habituation was important for both Thomas and Occam; however, Occam slightly modifies Thomas and that modification has important implications in Luther’s search for a gracious God.

From Thomas’s perspective the divine spark is infused with God’s grace, giving one the power to be contrite (contritio) and co-operate with God. This co-operation with God’s grace merits God’s reward (meritum de condign).  However, Occam asked an important question: if the process begins with God’s infusion of grace, can it truly merit anything? He answered, no! Therefore you should do the best you can. By doing your best, even as minimal as it is, this will merit (meritum de congruo) an infusion of grace: facienti quod in se est Deus non denegat gratiam (God will not deny his grace to anyone who does what lies within him.) Doing one’s best meant rejecting evil and doing good.

Within this context of covenant Luther struggled to prove that he was good enough to merit God’s grace. However, he failed to convince himself. He might have been contrite, but was he contrite enough?  This uncertainty afflicted (Anfectungen) him for years.

b. Theology of the Cross

Luther’s attempts to prove his worthiness failed.  He continued to be plagued by uncertainty and doubt concerning his salvation. Finally, during his Lectures on Paul’s Epistle to the Romans he found solace.  Instead of storehouses of merit, indulgences, habituation, and "doing what is within one," God accepts the sinner in spite of the sin. Acceptance is based on who one is rather than what one does. Justification is bestowed rather than achieved. Justification is not based on human righteousness, but on God’s righteousness—revealed and confirmed in Christ.

In St. Paul, Luther finally found a word of hope. He finally found a word of assurance and discovered the graciousness of God. The discovery of God’s graciousness pro me (for me) revolutionizes all aspects of Luther’s life and thought. From now on, Luther’s response to the trials of his life and the crises of the late medieval period was to be certain of God, but never to be secure in human society.

A tautology of Luther’s theology becomes: one must always “Let God be God.”  This frees human beings to be human.  We do not have to achieve salvation; rather, it is a gift to be received.  Salvation thus is the presupposition of the life of the Christian and not its goal.  This belief engendered his rejection of indulgences and his movement to a theologia crucis (Theology of the Cross).

Why were indulgences rejected? Simply put, they epitomize everything that from Luther’s perspective was wrong with the church. Instead of dependence upon God, they placed salvation in the hands of traveling salesmen hocking indulgences. They embody his rejection of all types of theology that are based in models of covenant.

The import of the Theology of the Cross was the discovery of God’s passive righteousness and theological models based in Testament.  From the author of Hebrews, Luther takes an understanding of Jesus Christ as the last will and testament of God. God has written humanity in the will as heirs of God and co-heirs with Christ (See Romans 8).

The rejection of covenant model theologies and the movement to testament is a fundamental aspect of Luther’s theologia crucis. It is a rejection of any type of a theology of glory (theologia gloriae). The rejection of the theology of glory has a profound impact on Luther’s anthropology of a Christian.

This rejection is illustrated by Luther’s small but significant alteration of Augustinian anthropology. In that system, human beings are partim bonnum, partim malum or partim iustus, partim peccare (partly good/just, partly bad/sinner). The goal of a Christian’s life is to grow in righteousness. In other words, one must work to decrease the side of the equation that is bad and sinful. As one decreases the sin in oneself, the good and just aspects of one’s being increase.

Luther’s anthropology, however, is an outright and total rejection of progress; because no matter how one understands it, it is a work and thus must be rejected. Luther’s alternative characterization of Christian anthropology was simul iustus et peccator (at once righteous and sinful.) Now, he begins to speak of righteousness in two ways: coram deo (righteousness before God) and coram hominibus (before man). Instead of a development in righteousness based in the person, or an infusion of merit from the saints, a person is judged righteous before God because of the works of Christ. But, absent the perspective of God and the righteousness of Christ, based on one’s own merit—a Christian still looks like a sinner.

c. The Law and the Gospel

The distinction between the Law and the Gospel is a fundamental dialectic in Luther’s thought. He argues that God interacts with humanity in two fundamental ways – the law and the gospel. The law comes to humanity as the commands of God – such as the Ten Commandments. The law allows the human community to exist and survive because it limits chaos and evil and convicts us of our sinfulness. All humanity has some grasp of the law through the conscience. The law convicts us our sin and drives us to the gospel, but it is not God’s avenue for salvation.

Salvation comes to humanity through the Good News (Gospel) of Jesus Christ. The Good News is that righteousness is not a demand upon the sinner but a gift to the sinner. The sinner simply accepts the gift through faith. For Luther the folly of indulgences was that they confused the law with the gospel. By stating that humanity must do something to merit forgiveness they promulgated the notion that salvation is achieved rather than received. Much of Luther’s career focused on deconstructing the idea of the law as an avenue for salvation.

d. Deus Absconditus – The Hidden God

Another fundamental aspect of Luther’s theology is his understanding of God. In rejecting much of scholastic thought Luther rejected the scholastic belief in continuity between revelation and perception. Luther notes that revelation must be indirect and concealed. Luther’s theology is based in the Word of God (thus his phrase sola scriptura – scripture alone). It is based not in speculation or philosophical principles, but in revelation.

Because of humanity’s fallen condition, one can neither understand the redemptive word nor can one see God face to face. Here Luther’s exposition on number twenty of his Heidelberg Disputation is important. It is an allusion to Exodus 33, where Moses seeks to see the Glory of the Lord but instead sees only the backside. No one can see God face to face and live, so God reveals himself on the backside, that is to say, where it seems he should not be. For Luther this meant in the human nature of Christ, in his weakness, his suffering, and his foolishness.

Thus revelation is seen in the suffering of Christ rather than in moral activity or created order and is addressed to faith. The Deus Absconditus is actually quite simple. It is a rejection of philosophy as the starting point for theology. Why? Because if one begins with philosophical categories for God one begins with the attributes of God: i.e., omniscient, omnipresent, omnipotent, impassible, etc. For Luther, it was impossible to begin there and by using syllogisms or other logical means to end up with a God who suffers on the cross on behalf of humanity. It simply does not work. The God revealed in and through the cross is not the God of philosophy but the God of revelation. Only faith can understand and appreciate this, logic and reason – to quote St. Paul become a stumbling block to belief instead of a helpmate.

3. Relationship to Philosophy

Given Luther’s critique of philosophy and his famous phrase that philosophy is the “devil’s whore,” it would be easy to assume that Luther had only contempt for philosophy and reason. Nothing could be further from the truth. Luther believed, rather, that philosophy and reason had important roles to play in our lives and in the life of the community. However, he also felt that it was important to remember what those roles were and not to confuse the proper use of philosophy with an improper one.

Properly understood and used, philosophy and reason are a great aid to individuals and society. Improperly used, they become a great threat to both. Likewise, revelation and the gospel when used properly are an aid to society, but when misused also have sad and profound implications.

The proper role of philosophy is organizational and as an aid in governance. When Cardinal Cajetan first demanded Luther’s recantation of the Ninety-Five Theses, Luther appealed to scripture and right reason. Reason can be an aid to faith in that it helps to clarify and organize, but it is always second-order discourse. It is, following St. Anselm, fides quarenes intellectum (faith seeking understanding) and never the reverse. Philosophy tells us that God is omnipotent and impassible; revelation tells us that Jesus Christ died for humanity’s sin. The two cannot be reconciled. Reason is the devil’s whore precisely because asks the wrong questions and looks in the wrong direction for answers. Revelation is the only proper place for theology to begin. Reason must always take a back-seat.

Reason does play a primary role in governance and in most human interaction. Reason, Luther argued, is necessary for a good and just society. In fact, unlike most of his contemporaries, Luther did not believe that a ruler had to be Christian, only reasonable. Here, opposite to his discussion of theology, it is revelation that is improper. Trying to govern using the gospel as one’s model would either corrupt the government or corrupt the gospel. The gospel’s fundamental message is forgiveness, government must maintain justice. To confuse the two here is just as troubling as confusing them when discussing theology. If forgiveness becomes the dominant model in government, people being sinful, chaos will increase. If however, the government claims the gospel but acts on the basis of justice, then people will be misled as to the proper nature of the gospel.

Luther was self-consciously trying to carve out proper realms for revelation and philosophy or reason. Each had a proper role that enables humanity to thrive. Chaos only became a problem when the two got confused.One cannot understand Luther’s relationship to philosophy and his discussions of philosophy without understanding that key concept.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

Key Primary Sources in English:

  • Luther's Works (LW), ed. J. Pelikan and H.T. Lehmann. St. Louis, MO: Concordia, and Philadelphia, PA: Fortress Press, 1955 -1986. 55 vols.
    • Of all the major works of Luther, this is the best edition in English. It will soon be out on CD-Rom.
  • 1513-1515, Lectures on the Psalms (LW: 10 -11).
    • Luther’s earliest lectures. These are important because we begin to see themes that will eventually become the Theology of the Cross.
  • 1515-1516, Lectures on Romans (LW: 25).
    • The patterns of the Theology of the Cross become a bit more evident. Many scholars believe that Luther made his final discovery of the doctrine of Justification by Faith while giving these lectures.
  • 1517, Ninety Five Theses (LW: 31).
    • The seminal document of the Reformation in Germany. These theses led to the eventual break with Rome over indulgences and grace.
  • 1518, Heidelberg Disputation (LW: 31)
    • The best example of Luther’s emerging Theology of the Cross.He contrasts human works to God’s works in and through the Cross and shows the emptiness of human achievement and the importance of grace.
  • 1519, Two Kinds of Righteousness (LW:31).
    • Summary of his position that righteousness is received rather than achieved.
  • 1520, Freedom of a Christian (LW: 31).
    • Luther’s ethics, in which he explains that “A Christian is a perfectly free lord of all, subject to none. A Christian is perfectly dutiful servant of all, subject to all.”
  • 1520, To the German Nobility (LW: 44).
    • A call for reform in Germany, it highlights some of the complexity of Luther’s thought on church and state relations.
  • 1521, Concerning the Letter and the Spirit (LW:39).
    • A summary of the Law and Gospel.
  • 1522, Preface to Romans (LW: 35).
    • A summary of Luther’s understanding of Justification by Faith.
  • 1523, On Temporal Authority (LW 45).
    • Sets out Luther’s doctrine of the Two Kingdom’s most clearly.
  • 1525, The Bondage of the Will (LW: 33).
    • In a debate with Erasmus about human freedom and bondage to sin. Luther argues that humanity is bound to sin completely and only freed from that bondage by God’s Grace.
  • 1525, Against the Robbing and Murdering Hordes of Peasants (LW:45).
    • Written before the Peasant’s War, it was published afterward.
  • 1530, Larger Catechism (LW:34).
    • A summary of Christian doctrine, to be used in instruction.
  • 1531, Dr. Martin Luther's Warning to His Dear German People (LW:45).
    • Luther’s first expression of a right to resist tyranny.
  • 1536, Disputation Concerning Justification (LW: 34).
    • A mature presentation of Luther’s doctrine on Justification.
  • 1536, Disputation Concerning Man (LW: 34).
    • His anthropology, but also gives a glimpse of his understanding of the proper role of philosophy and reason.

b. Secondary Sources

Key Secondary Sources in English on the Life and Thought of Luther:

  • Bainton,Roland H.Here I Stand: A Life of Martin Luther.  New York: Abingdon-Cokesbury Press, 1950.
    • The most popular biography of Luther, it is readeable and very thorough.
  • Brecht, Martin. Martin Luther. Three Volumes. Translated by James L. Schaaf. Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1985-1993.
    • The authoritative biography of Luther.
  • Cameron, Euan. The European Reformation.Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991.
    • An excellent introduction to the Reformation era.
  • Cargill Thompson,W.D.J. The Political Thought of Martin Luther.  Edited by Philip Broadhead. Totowa, NJ: Barnes & Noble Books, 1984.
    • The best work on Luther's political theology.
  • Edwards, Mark U., Jr. Luther’s Last Battles: Politics and Polemics, 1531-1546.Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1983.
    • One of the few books to focus on the older Luther. It is an excellent study in Luther after the Diet of Augsburg.
  • Forde, Gerhard, O.On Being a Theologian of the Cross: Reflections on Luther’s Heidelberg Disputation, 1518. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, 1997.
    • The Theology of the Cross is a fundamental doctrine in Luther. Forde takes an new look at the doctrine in light of Luther's role as pastor.
  • George, Timothy. Theology of the Reformers.  Nashville: Broadman Press, 1988.
    • This is an excellent introduction to Luther and puts his thought in dialogue with other major reformers, i.e., Zwingli and Calvin.
  • Lindberg, Carter. The European Reformations Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, Ltd., 1996.
    • The best introduction to the Reformation era, it covers not only the reformers but the context and culture of the era as well.
  • Loewenich, Walter von. Luther’s Theology of the Cross, trans. Herber J.A. Bouman. Minneapolis: Augsburg Publishing House, 1976.
    • The classic work on the Theology of the Cross.
  • Lohse, Bernhard. Martin Luther:An Introduction to his Life and Work.  Translated by Robert C. Schultz.Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1986.
    • In a handbook format, this is an essential ready-reference to Luther and his works.
  • McGrath, Alister E. The Intellectual Origins of the European Reformation. Oxford: Blackwell Press, 1987.
    • This book covers the scholastic and nominalist background of the reformation.
  • Oberman,Heiko. The Dawn of the Reformation: Essays in Late Medieval and Early Reformation Thought. Edinburgh: T & T Clark, 1986.
    • A classic that places the reformation era within the wider context of the late medieval era and the early modern era.
  • Luther: Man between God and the Devil.  Translated by Eileen Walliser-Schwarzbart. New York: Image Books, Doubleday:1982.
    • An excellent biography of Luther that examines Luther in light of his quest for a gracious God and his fight against the Devil.
  • Ozment, Steven. The Age of Reform:1250-1550:An Intellectual and Religious History of Late Medieval and Reformation Europe.  New Haven:Yale University Press, 1980.
    • Ozment places the reformation in a wider context and sees the impetus for reform stretching back into what is normally considered the High Medieval Era.
  • Pelikan, Jaroslav. The Christian Tradition: A History of the Development of Doctrine. Volume 4: Reformation of Church and Dogma (1300-1700). Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984.
    • Part of a five volume history of doctrine, Pelikan looks at the doctrinal issues at work in the reformation. He is not as concerned with history as he is with theological development.
  • Rupp,Gordon. Patterns of Reformation.  Philadelphia: Fortress Press,1969.
    • A thorough study of the wider issues raised by the reformation.
  • Watson,Philip S. Let God be God!: An Interpretation of the Theology of Martin Luther. London: Epworth Press, 1947.
    • A classic study stressing the theocentric nature of Luther's thought.

Author Information

David M. Whitford
Claflin University
U. S. A.

Jean-François Lyotard (1924—1998)

LyotardFrench post-structuralist philosopher, best known for his highly influential formulation of postmodernism in The Postmodern Condition. Despite its popularity, however, this book is in fact one of his more minor works. Lyotard's writings cover a large range of topics in philosophy, politics, and aesthetics, and experiment with a wide variety of styles. His works can be roughly divided into three categories: early writings on phenomenology, politics, and the critique of structuralism, the intermediate libidinal philosophy, and later work on postmodernism and the "differend." The majority of his work, however, is unified by a consistent view that reality consists of singular events which cannot be represented accurately by rational theory. For Lyotard, this fact has a deep political import, since politics claims to be based on accurate representations of reality. Lyotard's philosophy exhibits many of the major themes common to post-structuralist and postmodernist thought. He calls into question the powers of reason, asserts the importance of nonrational forces such as sensations and emotions, rejects humanism and the traditional philosophical notion of the human being as the central subject of knowledge, champions heterogeneity and difference, and suggests that the understanding of society in terms of "progress" has been made obsolete by the scientific, technological, political and cultural changes of the late twentieth century. Lyotard deals with these common themes in a highly original way, and his work exceeds many popular conceptions of postmodernism in its depth, imagination, and rigor. His thought remains pivotal in contemporary debates surrounding philosophy, politics, social theory, cultural studies, art and aesthetics.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Early Works
    1. Phenomenology
    2. Algeria
    3. Discourse, Figure
  3. Libidinal Philosophy
  4. Postmodernism
    1. Paganism
    2. The Postmodern Condition
    3. The Differend
  5. Reason and Representation
  6. The Subject and the Inhuman
  7. Science and Technology
  8. Politics
  9. Art and Aesthetics
  10. Late Works
    1. Malraux
    2. Augustine
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Books by Lyotard
    2. Books about Lyotard

1. Biography

Jean-François Lyotard was born in Vincennes, France, on August 10, 1924. His father, Jean-Pierre Lyotard, was a sales representative. His mother's maiden name was Madeleine Cavalli. He was schooled at the Paris Lycées Buffon and Louis-le-Grand, and his youthful aspirations to be a Dominican monk, a painter, an historian, or a novelist eventually gave way to a career in philosophy. He studied philosophy and literature at the Sorbonne (after twice failing the entrance exam to the Ecole Normale Supérieure), where he became friends with Gilles Deleuze. His early interest in philosophies of indifference resulted in his M.A. dissertation Indifference as an Ethical Notion. Lyotard describes his existence up until the Second World War as a 'poetic, introspective and solitary way of thinking and living.' The war disrupted both his way of life and his thought; he acted as a first-aid volunteer in the fight for liberation in the Paris streets in August 1944, and gave up the idea of indifference for a commitment to the investigation of reality in terms of social interactions. Lyotard became a husband and father at a young age, marrying Andrée May in 1948 and subsequently having two children, Corinne and Laurence. Lyotard passed the agrégation (the examination required in order to teach in France) and took up a position teaching philosophy at a boy's lycée (school) in Constantine in French-occupied East Algeria in 1950. From 1952-59 he taught at a school for the sons of military personnel at La Flèche. In Constantine Lyotard read Marx and became acquainted with the Algerian political situation, which he believed was ripe for socialist revolution. In 1954 Lyotard joined the socialist revolutionary organisation Socialisme ou Barbarie (Socialism or Barbarism). Other members of the organisation included Cornelius Castoriadis, Claude Lefort, and Pierre Souyris. Lyotard had met Souyris at a union meeting late in 1950, and they had a long and close friendship, eventually troubled by political and theoretical differences.

Lyotard became an intellectual militant, and asserts that for fifteen years he was so dedicated to the cause of socialist revolution that no other aspect of life (with the sole exception of love) diverted him from this task. His writings in this period are solely concerned with ultra-left revolutionary politics, with a sharp focus on the Algerian situation (the war of independence had broken out in 1954). He contributed to and edited the Socialisme ou Barbarie journal, and wrote pamphlets to distribute to workers at protests and at factory gates. In 1964 a schism erupted in Socialisme ou Barbarie over Castoriadis' new theoretical direction for the group. Lyotard, along with Souyris, became a member of the splinter group Pouvoir Ouvrier (Worker's Power), but resigned in 1966. He had lost belief in the legitimacy of Marxism as a totalising theory, and returned to the study and writing of philosophy. From 1959 to 1966 Lyotard was maître-assistant at the Sorbonne, and then gained a position in the philosophy department at the University of Paris X, Nanterre. There he took part in the May 1968 political actions, organising demonstrations for the "March 22 Movement."

Lyotard attended the radical psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan's seminars in the mid-60s, and his reaction to Lacan’s theories resulted in Discours, figure, for which he received the degree of doctorat d'état. From 1968 to 1970 Lyotard was chargé de recherches at the Centre National de la Recherche Scientifique. In the early 1970s Lyotard was appointed to the University of Paris VIII, Vincennes, where he was a popular teacher and a prolific writer. In 1972 he was made maître de conferences, and in 1987 he became Professor Emeritus at Vincennes. The 1979 publication of The Postmodern Condition brought Lyotard worldwide fame, and in the 1980s and 90s he lectured widely outside of France. Lyotard was professor of French and Italian at the University of California, Irvine, Robert W. Woodruff Professor of French at Emory University, and a founding member and sometime president of the Collège International de Philosophie. Lyotard was a visiting professor at numerous universities, including John Hopkins, the University of California, Berkeley and San Diego, the University of Minnesota, the Université de Montréal, Canada, the Universität Siegen, West Germany, and the University of Saõ Paulo, Brazil. Lyotard married his second wife Dolorès Djidzek in 1993 and had a son, David. Lyotard died of leukaemia in Paris on April 21, 1998.

2. Early Works

a. Phenomenology

Lyotard's first book, published in 1954, is a short introduction to and examination of phenomenology. The first part introduces phenomenology through the work of Edmund Husserl, and the second part evaluates phenomenology's relation to the human sciences (particularly psychology, sociology, and history). In the second part the focus shifts from Husserl to the work of Maurice Merleau-Ponty. Throughout, Lyotard is concerned with phenomenology's attempt to find a "third way" between subjectivism and objectivism, avoiding the problems of each. In particular, he is interested in the bearing this problem has on the question of whether phenomenology can think history politically, thus potentially contributing to Marxism. This theme (the relation of phenomenology to Marxism) was a prime concern for French thinkers of the fifties, and Lyotard's book is a useful documentation of the issues at stake. Much of his exposition and discussion is positive, and Lyotard argues that phenomenology can make valuable contributions to the social sciences, where it should serve two functions: firstly, to define the object of the science eidetically (i.e. in its essence) prior to all experimentation, and secondly, to philosophically reassess the results of experimentation. Lyotard argues, for example, that sociology has need of a phenomenological definition of the essence of the social before it can proceed effectively as a science. While he sees the usefulness of phenomenology in many disciplines, however, Lyotard's conclusions about the usefulness of phenomenology to Marxism are largely negative. He argues that phenomenology does not represent progress on Marxism, but is in fact a step backwards. For Lyotard phenomenology cannot properly formulate a materialist worldview and the objective nature of the relations of production; it ends up interpreting class struggle as taking place in consciousness. Lyotard rejects phenomenology's attempt to find a third way between subjectivism and objectivism, and asserts Marxism's superiority in viewing subjectivity as already contained in objectivity.

b. Algeria

In the fifteen years between his first two books of philosophy, Lyotard devoted all his writing efforts to the cause of revolutionary politics. His most substantial writings of this time were his contributions to the Socialisme ou Barbarie journal on the political situation in Algeria [many of which are collected in Political Writings]. The project of Socialisme ou Barbarie was to provide theoretical resources to contribute to socialist revolution, critiquing other existing socialist strands (particularly Stalinism and the French communist party) as a hindrance to revolution, and with a particular emphasis on the critique of bureaucracy. In the essays on Algeria, Lyotard applies this project to the French occupation, trying to determine the potential for socialist revolution arising from this situation. He pays close attention to the economic forces at work in occupied Algeria, arguing that it is in the economic interests of France to keep Algerians in a state of underdevelopment and poverty. Furthermore, Lyotard introduces a notion of 'terror' that he develops more fully in his later works, indicating the suppression of Algerian culture by the imposition of foreign (French) cultural forms. The conclusion Lyotard comes to is that the occupation must end if the Algerian people are to prosper, but he remains ambivalent about the possibility of revolution. He surmises that a nationalist, democratic revolution will only lead to new forms of social inequality and domination, and insists that a socialist revolution is necessary. This ambivalence was reflected in Socialisme ou Barbarie's debate about whether or not to support the Algerian war of independence, fearing that its democratic and nationalistic leanings would not bring about the result they desired. In "Algeria Evacuated," written after the end of the occupation, Lyotard regretfully asks why a socialist revolution did not take place, concluding that the social and political upheavals resulted in an opportunistic struggle for power rather than a class-based action. The end result of Lyotard's work on Algeria and the disappointment at the failure of socialist revolution to take place led him to an abandonment of revolutionary socialism and traditional Marxism on the grounds that social reality is too complex to describe accurately with any master-discourse.

c. Discourse, Figure

Lyotard's second book of philosophy is long and difficult. It covers a wide variety of topics, including phenomenology, psychoanalysis, structuralism, poetry and art, Hegelian dialectics, semiotics, and philosophy of language. The main thrust of this work, however, is a critique of structuralism, particularly as it manifests itself in Lacan's psychoanalysis. The book is divided into two parts: the first uses Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology to undermine structuralism, and the second uses Freudian psychoanalysis to undermine both Lacanian psychoanalysis and certain aspects of phenomenology. Lyotard begins with an opposition between discourse, related to structuralism and written text, and figure (a visual image), related to phenomenology and seeing. He suggests that structured, abstract conceptual thought has dominated philosophy since Plato, denigrating sensual experience. The written text and the experience of reading are associated with the former, and figures, images and the experience of seeing with the latter. Part of Lyotard's aim is to defend the importance of the figural and sensual experience such as seeing. He proceeds to deconstruct this opposition, however, and attempts to show that discourse and figure are mutually implicated. Discourse contains elements of the figural (poetry and illuminated texts are good examples), and visual space can be structured like discourse (when it is broken up into ordered elements in order for the world to be recognisable and navigable by the seeing subject). He develops an idea of the figural as a disruptive force which works to interrupt established structures in the realms of both reading and seeing. Ultimately, the point is not to privilege the figural over the discursive, but to show how these elements must negotiate with each other. The mistake of structuralism is to interpret the figural in entirely discursive terms, ignoring the different ways in which these elements operate. In the second part of Discours, figure, structure and transgression are related to Freudian libidinal forces, paving the way for the libidinal philosophy developed in Libidinal Economy.

3. Libidinal Philosophy

In the early 1970s Lyotard developed a philosophy based around Sigmund Freud's theory of the libido. For Lyotard, libidinal energy can be used as a "theoretical fiction" to describe the transformations that take place in society. After his break with Marxism and rejection of totalising theory, he sought to develop a theory that will take account of multiple and different forces and desires at work in any political or social situation, from the writing of theory to revolutionary politics to global economics. Lyotard's libidinal philosophy is developed in the major work Libidinal Economy and in two sets of essays, Dérive à partir de Marx et Freud [some of which is translated in Driftworks] and Des Dispositifs Pulsionnels. Libidinal Economy is an unusual and difficult work, and encompasses a complex set of theories concerning politics, economics, theory, academic style, and readings of Marx and Freud. It is written in a bewildering combination of styles (at times reading more like an avant-garde novel than a philosophical text), a method Lyotard uses in an attempt to overcome the limitations he sees in traditional academic theory.

The libidinal philosophy begins Lyotard's general commitment to an ontology of events, which also underlies his later postmodern philosophy. Lyotard sees reality in terms of unpredictable happenings (events), rather than structured regularities. These events can be interpreted in different ways, and no single interpretation will capture events accurately. Events always exceed interpretation; there is always something "left over" that an interpretation does not account for. In the libidinal philosophy Lyotard uses the idea of libidinal energy to describe events and the way they are interpreted or exploited, and he develops a philosophy of society and theory in terms of the economy of libidinal energies. Lyotard uses the terms "libidinal intensities," and "affects” to refer to events. These intensities and affects are, in more common terminology, feelings and desires. In the terms of Freudian psychoanalysis, they are the "primary processes" of the libido, the forces that exist in the body on a more basic level than the "secondary processes" of the conscious mind. In particular, Lyotard focuses on sexual desire. He uses these terms metaphorically, however, to describe the workings of reality and society as a whole, divorcing them from their usual attachments to human beings. Lyotard describes the wholly impersonal as well as the personal in terms of feelings and desires, and paints a picture of the world that moves and is moved in the ways that feelings move people. Lyotard admits that this description of everything in libidinal terms is a "theoretical fiction," merely a way of speaking which gives us useful terms for theorizing about what happens in the world. Metaphysically, Lyotard is a materialist, and for him affects must be understood as concrete material entities. An affect might be a sound, a color, a smile or a caress: anything which has an ability to "move," to produce feelings and desires. Affects are structured and interpreted in systems made up of dispositifs, libidinal dispositions or set-ups, and society is composed of multitudes of different dispositions that compete to exploit the energies of libidinal events. Lyotard develops a complex set of figures to describe how this process takes place.

Libidinal Economy begins with the figure of a body (ambivalently sexed), being cut open and spread out to form a flat, band-like surface. Lyotard is here beginning to describe a region on which libidinal intensities take place and on which they meet with the dispositifs that channel libidinal energy. This region is material like the body, but it is not yet organized, thus the figure of dismemberment. The flat band that the body has become is then given a twist and joined end to end, forming a moebius strip (a circular figure which has only one surface due to the twist it contains; a line traced along one side of the strip will end up on the other side without breaking contact with the surface). This strip is then set in motion, circulating so fast it glows red with heat. This is the libidinal band (sometimes called the libidinal skin). It represents the "primary processes" of desire and libidinal intensity in which libidinal energy circulates in an aleatory fashion, not yet investing anything. Because the libidinal band is a moebius strip, desire circulates on only one surface; there is no inside or outside. In time the band begins to slow and cool, and forms what Lyotard calls "the (disjunctive) bar."

As the bar slows, sometimes it invests this region, sometimes that. It becomes disjunctive, distinguishing this from not-this. This stage in the transformation of the libidinal band represents the formation of rational thought, dominated by binary logic and the law of noncontradiction. Finally the bar stops and forms a stable disjunction. Lyotard describes the bar as then turning around on itself and creating an enclosed space, a theatrical volume. This is the particular transformation of the libidinal band - or the particular dispositif on the libidinal band – that gives rise to representation and theory. The theatrical space has an inside and an outside, a clear disjunction between this and not-this. Lyotard's image of theory as theatre is based on the etymological relationship between the two terms; they are both derived from the Greek theasthai, meaning to look at, contemplate, or behold. The theorist is like a spectator who views the representation of the world (outside the theatre) on the stage (inside the theatre).

Lyotard's description of the transformations of the libidinal band is a theoretical fiction which provides an account of how the world works through the interplay of intense, excited libidinal energies and the stable structures which exploit them and dampen their intensity. The band is the space on which libidinal intensities meet dispositifs, or libidinal set-ups. These set-ups channel energy into more or less stable systems and structures, and therefore all dispositifs, all systems and structures, can be described in terms of the slowing and cooling of the band. An example would be the way political institutions channel desires to change society away from violent, disruptive eruptions towards more moderate, less disruptive modes of action. Systems exploit libidinal intensities by channeling them into stable structures. And yet, these systems deny their own origins in intense and aleatory libidinal energy, taking themselves to be permanent and stable. Systems hide, or dissimulate, affects (libidinal intensities). Conversely, however, affects dissimulate systems. Systems and affects dissimulate each other. This means that systems contain and hide affects, and that affects contain and hide the possibility for forming systems. Dissimulation is a concept that allows us to see the elements of the libidinal economy as duplicitous. That is, they have more than one possibility. It is always possible for intensities to channel into a stable system, or to disrupt a system by destabilising it through intense investment.

Lyotard develops a critical but nuanced approach towards theory, politics and economics within the terms of the libidinal philosophy. His prime concern is that the structures that exploit libidinal intensities tend to become hegemonic. That is, they tend to claim sole right to the exploitation or interpretation of intensities. At the same time, they often deny libidinal intensities themselves, taking themselves to be primary and stable structures. Lyotard sees these tendencies as limiting and nihilistic, in the sense that they deny the full possibilities of the expression of intensities. In theory, politics, and cultural conventions, structured dispositions take themselves to be the actual structures of reality or "correct" interpretations, thus limiting the possibilities of change. For Lyotard change is life affirming, whereas the stable structures that inhibit change are nihilistic and life denying. However, Lyotard does not simply assert libidinal intensity as an affirmative "other" to nihilism. For Lyotard, there is no affirmative region, no pure outside to nihilism. Lyotard does not propose that we champion affects, singularities, intensities and libidinal energy over systems, structures, theory, concepts and representation. This is because the only way libidinal energies can exist is within structures. Lyotard does not advocate a simple liberation of desire and does not attempt to set up a place beyond representation which would be immune to the effects of nihilism. Lyotard presents us, rather, with a metaphysical system in which intensities and structures are both essential elements of the libidinal economy.

Lyotard's response to the nihilism of structure takes place through the concept of dissimulation, which suggests that libidinal energy must work within structures. All structures contain libidinal energy as an under-exploited potentiality, waiting to be released and to flow into new structures. This libidinal energy is the event, which always contains more possibilities for interpretation and exploitation than any single structure can give it. Lyotard's libidinal philosophy prescribes a "freeing up" of structures, so that events may be allowed their maximum potentiality of expression in competing interpretations and dispositions. Releasing the energy in structures in turn creates new events, with their own energetic potentialities. Because the event is unpredictable, we cannot actively control the way it will be released and form new structures. However, we can "act passively" so as to encourage the maximum release of intensity within structures. Lyotard's own style of writing in Libidinal Economy is one attempt to do this: by multiplying genres of discourse, there is no overall dominant structure in the text and it is open to several competing modes of reading, interpretation and application. Ultimately, libidinal philosophy suggests a method of subversion from within existing structures through experimentation with the forms of those structures.

4. Postmodernism

Lyotard abandoned his libidinal philosophy in the later years of the seventies, beginning a philosophy of paganism that developed, by the eighties, into his unique version of postmodernism. The turn from the libidinal to the pagan and the postmodern continued a concern with events and the limits of representation, but concerned two key changes: 1. A change in the mode of analysis from libidinal forces to language, and 2. a new focus on justice. Whereas in the libidinal philosophy the focus was to see that a single interpretation of an event did not become hegemonic, in Lyotard's later philosophy he is primarily concerned with the problems of justice that arise between competing interpretations of events. Lyotard's philosophy of language and justice is most fully developed through the concept of the differend, in the book of the same name.

a. Paganism

Lyotard develops the notion of paganism in "Lessons in Paganism" (reprinted in The Lyotard Reader), Just Gaming and various other short works of the late seventies. The term "paganism" refers to a way of thinking that takes into account and strives to do justice to incommensurable differences. Just as pagan religions believe in a number of different gods rather than just one God, Lyotard's pagan philosophy represents a concern for pluralism and multiplicity (terms he uses synonymously to oppose the idea of universality). This concern for difference, multiplicity and pluralism is related to Lyotard's basic commitment to an ontology of singular events: if reality is constituted by unique happenings, then there will be no universal law of judgement which will be able to take account of each and every event in a way which does them all justice. Paganism suggests that there are irreducible differences in the order of things, and that we must take things on their own terms without attempting to reduce them to universals. In his writings on paganism, Lyotard analyses politics in the form of a justice of rhetoric. In "Lessons in Paganism" he claims that all discourse is narrative; all theory, all politics, all law, are merely a collection of stories. In Just Gaming, he analyses situations where questions of justice and judgement arise in terms of language games. Lyotard rejects the claims of any discourse to be grounded in truth. He rejects the idea of a master-discourse (later called a metanarrative) that is thought to provide the basis for judgement in all situations. (Marxism, Hegelian philosophy, and Kant's ideal of unity or totality as regulating justice are examples of master-discourses that have dominated the philosophical tradition.) Instead, Lyotard suggests that paganism is the most appropriate response to the desire for justice. Paganism is godless politics; it is the abandonment of universal judgement for specific, plural judgements. This means giving up the idea of a single, law-like theoretical schema which could be applied to any situation in which judgment is required. Lyotard asserts that a justice of multiplicities requires a multiplicity of justices. Paganism is the attempt to judge without pre-existing criteria, in matters of truth, beauty, politics and ethics.

Paganism rejects any universal criteria for judgement, yet Lyotard claims that we must judge, that justice demands this of us. So how do we judge, without criteria? Lyotard invokes both Kant and Nietzsche in his answer. In Kantian terms, we judge through the constitutive imagination. For Kant, this ability to judge, and to invent criteria, is mysterious, and there is little we can say about it. In Nietzschean terms, Lyotard says that judgement is an expression of the will to power. It is perhaps misleading of Lyotard to say that paganism is judgement without criteria; for it is judgement only without universal criteria. What he is denying is the possibility of a discourse that will give us adequate criteria for judgement in each and every case. Instead, what we must do (as pagans) is meet every circumstance that requires judgement anew, and create criteria specific to that case by an affirmative act of the imaginative will. Thus we will get a plurality of criteria, a plurality of judgements, a plurality of justices. In this sense, paganism can be thought of as a plurality of rules of judgement (gods), as opposed to belief in just one rule or set of rules (God). Somewhat paradoxically, perhaps (as Lyotard himself admits), the justice of this pluralism is assured by a prescriptive of universal value - the prescriptive that the rules of individual language games be respected; that they are not subsumed under a single criterion of judgement.

b. The Postmodern Condition

Lyotard soon abandoned the term 'paganism' in favour of ‘postmodernism.’ He presents his initial and highly influential formulation of postmodernism in The Postmodern Condition: A Report on Knowledge, commissioned by the government of Quebec and published in 1979. Lyotard famously defines the postmodern as 'incredulity towards metanarratives,' where metanarratives are understood as totalising stories about history and the goals of the human race that ground and legitimise knowledges and cultural practises. The two metanarratives that Lyotard sees as having been most important in the past are (1) history as progressing towards social enlightenment and emancipation, and (2) knowledge as progressing towards totalisation. Modernity is defined as the age of metanarrative legitimation, and postmodernity as the age in which metanarratives have become bankrupt. Through his theory of the end of metanarratives, Lyotard develops his own version of what tends to be a consensus among theorists of the postmodern - postmodernity as an age of fragmentation and pluralism.

The Postmodern Condition is a study of the status of knowledge in computerized societies. It is Lyotard's view that certain technical and technological advancements have taken place since the Second World War (his historical pin-pointing of the beginning of postmodernity) which have had and are still having a radical effect on the status of knowledge in the world's most advanced countries. As a defining element with which to characterise these technical and technological advancements, Lyotard chooses computerization. Lyotard identifies the problem with which he is dealing - the variable in the status of knowledge - as one of legitimation. For Lyotard, this is a question of both knowledge and power. Knowledge and power are simply two sides of the same question: who decides what knowledge is, and who knows what needs to be decided? According to Lyotard, in the computer age the question of knowledge is now more than ever a question of government. With vast amounts of knowledge stored digitally in databases, who decides what knowledge is worth storing (what is legitimate knowledge) and who has access to these databases? Lyotard points a suspicious finger at multinational corporations. Using IBM as an example, he suggests a hypothetical in which the corporation owns a certain belt in the Earth's orbital field in which circulate satellites for communication and/or for storing data banks. Lyotard then asks, 'who will have access to them? Who will determine which channels or data are forbidden? The State? Or will the State simply be one user among others?'

The method Lyotard chooses to use in his investigations is that of language games. Lyotard writes that the developments in postmodernity he is dealing with have been largely concerned with language: 'phonology and theories of linguistics, problems of communication and cybernetics, modern theories of algebra and informatics, computers and their languages, problems of translation and the search for areas of compatibility among computer languages, problems of information storage and data banks, telematics and the perfection of intelligent terminals, paradoxology.' Lyotard’s use of language games is derived from Ludwig Wittgenstein. The theory of language games means that each of the various categories of utterance can be defined in terms of rules specifying their properties and the uses to which they can be put. Lyotard makes three particularly important observations about language games. Firstly, the rules of language games do not carry within themselves their own legitimation, but are subject to a "contract" between “players” (interlocutors). Secondly, if there are no rules there is no game and even a small change in the rules changes the game. Thirdly, every utterance should be thought of as a "move" in a game. Different types of utterances, as identified by Wittgenstein, pertain to different types of language games. Lyotard gives us a few examples of types of utterances. The "denotative" is an utterance which attempts to correctly identify the object or referent to which it refers (such as "Snow is white"). The “performative” is an utterance which is itself a performance of an act to which it refers (such as "I promise"). The “prescriptive” is an utterance which instructs, recommends, requests, or commands (such as "Give me money"). For both Wittgenstein and Lyotard, language games are incommensurable, and moves in one language game cannot be translated into moves in another language game. For example, we cannot judge what ought to be the case (a prescriptive) from what is the case (a denotative.)

Lyotard's choice of language games is primarily political in motivation, and relates to the close links between knowledge and power. In examining the status of knowledge in postmodernity, Lyotard is examining the political as well as epistemological aspects of knowledge (legitimation), and he sees the basic social bond - the minimum relation required for society to exist - as moves within language games. Lyotard needs a methodological representation to apply to society in order to examine the status of knowledge in postmodern societies. He presents us with two alternative views of society that have been popular in this century: society as a unitary whole ("traditional" theory) or society as a binary division (“critical” theory). Lyotard rejects both of these alternatives on the grounds that the choice seems difficult or arbitrary, and also rejects a third alternative - that we might distinguish two kinds of equally legitimate knowledge, one based on the view of society as unitary and the other on the view of society as binary. This division of knowledge is caught within a type of oppositional thinking that Lyotard believes is out of step with postmodern modes of knowledge.

Instead of the recently popular or "modern" models of society, Lyotard argues that even as the status of knowledge has changed in postmodernity, so has the nature of the social bond, particularly as it is evident in society's institutions of knowledge. Lyotard presents a postmodern methodological representation of society as composed of multifarious and fragmented language games, but games which strictly (but not rigidly - the rules of a game can change) control the moves which can be made within them by reference to narratives of legitimation which are deemed appropriate by their respective institutions. Thus one follows orders in the army, prays in church, questions in philosophy, etc., etc. In his analysis of the state of knowledge in postmodernity, Lyotard firstly distinguishes between two types of knowledge - "narrative" knowledge and “scientific” knowledge. Narrative knowledge is the kind of knowledge prevalent in "primitive" or “traditional' societies, and is based on storytelling, sometimes in the form of ritual, music and dance. Narrative knowledge has no recourse to legitimation - its legitimation is immediate within the narrative itself, in the "timelessness" of the narrative as an enduring tradition - it is told by people who once heard it to listeners who will one day tell it themselves. There is no question of questioning it. Indeed, Lyotard suggests that there is an incommensurability between the question of legitimation itself and the authority of narrative knowledge.

In scientific knowledge, however, the question of legitimation always arises. Lyotard says that one of the most striking features of scientific knowledge is that it includes only denotative statements, to the exclusion of all other kinds (narrative knowledge includes other kinds of statements, such as prescriptives). According to the "narrative" of science, however, only knowledge which is legitimated is legitimate - i.e. is knowledge at all. Scientific knowledge is legitimated by certain scientific criteria - the repeatability of experiments, etc. If the entire project of science needs a metalegitimation, however (and the criteria for scientific knowledge would itself seem to demand that it does) then science has no recourse but to narrative knowledge (which according to scientific criteria is no knowledge at all). This narrative has usually taken the form of a heroic epic of some kind, with the scientist as a "hero of knowledge" who discovers scientific truths. The distinction between narrative and scientific knowledge is a crucial point in Lyotard's theory of postmodernism, and one of the defining features of postmodernity, on his account, is the dominance of scientific knowledge over narrative knowledge. The pragmatics of scientific knowledge do not allow the recognition of narrative knowledge as legitimate, since it is not restricted to denotative statements). Lyotard sees a danger in this dominance, since it follows from his view that reality cannot be captured within one genre of discourse or representation of events that science will miss aspects of events which narrative knowledge will capture. In other words, Lyotard does not believe that science has any justification in claiming to be a more legitimate form of knowledge than narrative. Part of his work in The Postmodern Condition can be read as a defence of narrative knowledge from the increasing dominance of scientific knowledge. Furthermore, Lyotard sees a danger to the future of academic research which stems from the way scientific knowledge has come to be legitimated in postmodernity (as opposed to the way it was legitimated in modernity).

In modernity the narrative of science was legitimated by one of a number of metanarratives, the two principal ones being respectively Hegelian and Marxist in nature. The Hegelian metanarrative speculates on the eventual totality and unity of all knowledge; scientific advancement is legitimated by the story that it will one day lead us to that goal. The Marxist metanarrative gives science a role in the emancipation of humanity. According to Lyotard, postmodernity is characterised by the end of metanarratives. So what legitimates science now? Lyotard's answer is - performativity. This is what Lyotard calls the "technological criterion" - the most efficient input/output ratio. The technical and technological changes over the last few decades - as well as the development of capitalism - have caused the production of knowledge to become increasingly influenced by a technological model. It was during the industrial revolution, Lyotard suggests, that knowledge entered into the economic equation and became a force for production, but it is in postmodernity that knowledge is becoming the central force for production. Lyotard believes that knowledge is becoming so important an economic factor, in fact, that he suggests that one day wars will be waged over the control of information.

Lyotard calls the change that has taken place in the status of knowledge due to the rise of the performativity criterion the mercantilization of knowledge. In postmodernity, knowledge has become primarily a saleable commodity. Knowledge is produced in order to be sold, and is consumed in order to fuel a new production. According to Lyotard knowledge in postmodernity has largely lost its truth-value, or rather, the production of knowledge is no longer an aspiration to produce truth. Today students no longer ask if something is true, but what use it is to them. Lyotard believes that computerization and the legitimation of knowledge by the performativity criterion is doing away with the idea that the absorption of knowledge is inseparable from the training of minds. In the near future, he predicts, education will no longer be given "en bloc" to people in their youth as a preparation for life. Rather, it will be an ongoing process of learning updated technical information that will be essential for their functioning in their respective professions.

Lyotard does not believe that the innovations he predicts in postmodern education will necessarily have a detrimental effect on erudition. He does, however, see a problem with the legitimation of knowledge by performativity. This problem lies in the area of research. Legitimation by performativity lends itself to what Lyotard calls "terror" - the exclusion of players from language games or the exclusion of certain games entirely. Most true "discoveries," Lyotard argues, are discoveries by virtue of the fact that they are so radical that they change the rules of the game - they cannot even be articulated within the rules of the "dominant" game (which is dominant because it draws the consensus of opinions). Many discoveries are not found to have a use until quite some time after they are made; therefore they seem to be of little value by the performativity criterion. Furthermore, for economic reasons, legitimation by performativity tends to follow the consensus opinion - that which is perceived by the majority of experts to have the most efficient input/output ratio is considered most likely in fact to be most performatively efficient, and hence the safest investment.

Lyotard argues that legitimation by performativity is against the interests of research. He does not claim that research should be aimed at production of "the truth"; he does not try to re-invoke the metanarratives of modernity to legitimate research. Rather, he sees the role of research as the production of ideas. Legitimation of knowledge by performativity terrorises the production of ideas. What, then, is the alternative? Lyotard proposes that a better form of legitimation would be legitimation by paralogy. The etymology of this word resides in the Greek words para - beside, past, beyond - and logos in its sense as "reason." Thus paralogy is the movement beyond or against reason. Lyotard sees reason not as a universal and immutable human faculty or principle but as a specific and variable human production; "paralogy" for him means the movement against an established way of reasoning. In relation to research, this means the production of new ideas by going against or outside of established norms, of making new moves in language games, changing the rules of language games and inventing new games. Lyotard argues that this is in fact what takes place in scientific research, despite the imposition of the performativity criterion of legitimation. This is particularly evident in what Lyotard calls "postmodern science" - the search for instabilities [see Science and Technology]. For Lyotard, knowledge is not only the known but also the "revelation" or “articulation” of the unknown. Thus he advocates the legitimation of knowledge by paralogy as a form of legitimation that would satisfy both the desire for justice and the desire for the unknown.

c. The Differend

Lyotard develops the philosophy of language that underlies his work on paganism and postmodernism most fully in The Differend: Phrases in Dispute. This book is, by Lyotard's own estimation, both his most philosophical and most important. Here he analyses how injustices take place in the context of language. A differend is a case of conflict between parties that cannot be equitably resolved for lack of a rule of judgement applicable to both. In the case of a differend, the parties cannot agree on a rule or criterion by which their dispute might be decided. A differend is opposed to a litigation - a dispute which can be equitably resolved because the parties involved can agree on a rule of judgement. Lyotard distinguishes the victim from the plaintiff. The later is the wronged party in a litigation; the former, the wronged party in a differend. In a litigation, the plaintiff's wrong can be presented. In a differend, the victim’s wrong cannot be presented. A victim, for Lyotard, is not just someone who has been wronged, but someone who has also lost the power to present this wrong. This disempowerment can occur in several ways: it may quite literally be a silencing; the victim may be threatened into silence or in some other way disallowed to speak. Alternatively, the victim may be able to speak, but that speech is unable to present the wrong done in the discourse of the rule of judgement. The victim may not be believed, may be thought to be mad, or not be understood. The discourse of the rule of judgement may be such that the victim's wrong cannot be translated into its terms; the wrong may not be presentable as a wrong.

Lyotard presents various examples of the differend, the most important of which is Auschwitz. He uses the example of the revisionist historian Faurisson's demands for proof of the Holocaust to show how the differend operates as a sort of double bind or "catch-22." Faurisson will only accept proof of the existence of gas chambers from eyewitnesses who were themselves victims of the gas chambers. But of course, any such eyewitnesses are dead and are not able to testify. Faurisson concludes from this that there were no gas chambers. The situation is this: either there were no gas chambers, in which case there would be no eyewitnesses to produce evidence, or there were gas chambers, in which case there would still be no eyewitnesses to produce evidence (since they would be dead). Since Faurisson will accept no evidence for the existence of gas chambers except the testimony of actual victims, he will conclude from both possibilities (i.e. gas chambers existed; gas chambers didn't exist) that gas chambers didn't exist. The situation is a double bind because there are two alternatives - either there were gas chambers or there were not - which lead to the same conclusion: there were no gas chambers (and no Final Solution). The case is a differend because the harm done to the victims cannot be presented in the standard of judgment upheld by Faurisson. Lyotard presents the logic of the double bind involved in the differend in general as follows: either p or not p; if not-p, then Fp; if p, then not-p, then Fp. The two possibilities (p or not-p) both lead to the same conclusion (Fp). Lyotard gives a further example of the logic of the double bind: it is like saying both either it is white, or it is not white; and if it is white it is not white.

Another example of the differend which commentators on Lyotard often invoke is that of indigenous peoples' claims to land rights in colonised countries. This example shows the relevance of Lyotard's work for practical problems of justice in the contemporary world. Let us take Australian Aborigines as an example. Many tribal groups claim that land which they traditionally inhabited is now owned and controlled by the descendants of European colonists. They claim that the land was taken from them wrongfully, and that it should be given back to them. There is a differend in this case because Aboriginal land rights are established by tribal law, and evidence for such rights may not be presentable in the law of the Australian government. The court of appeal in which claims to land rights are heard functions entirely according to government law, and tribal law is not considered a valid system of judgment. In the case of a dispute over a certain area of land by farmers who are descendants of colonists on the one hand, and a tribe of Aborigines on the other hand, the court of appeal will be the one which involves the law that the farmers recognise (government law), while the law that the Aborigines recognise (tribal law) will not be considered valid. It may be the case that the only evidence for the claim to land rights that the Aborigines have will not be admissible as evidence in the court of government law (though it is perfectly acceptable in tribal law). Hence, we have a case of a wrong which cannot be presented as a wrong; a differend.

Lyotard develops the theory of the differend through a complex analysis of language, drawing heavily on analytic philosophers as well as ancients and early moderns. Lyotard's ontology of events is developed here in terms of the phrase as event, and the limits of representation are seen in the indeterminacy involved in the linking of phrases. Phrases, on Lyotard's account, may be extralinguistic, and can include signs, gestures, or anything that happens. Every event is to be understood as a phrase in the philosophy of the differend. This characterisation of events as phrases may be understood as a theoretical fiction or "a way of speaking" which allows Lyotard to develop a theory of events through the analysis of language, just as the libidinal philosophy does using libidinal energy. Lyotard calls the way phrases are linked together in series, one after the other, the concatenation of phrases. The law of concatenation states that these linkages must be made - that is, a phrase must be followed by another phrase - but that how to link is never determinate. There are many possible ways of linking on to a phrase, and no way is the right way.

In order to characterise phrases as events which are beyond full understanding and accurate representation, Lyotard undermines the common view that the meanings of phrases can be determined by what they refer to (the referent). That is, for Lyotard the meaning of a phrase as event (something happens) cannot be fixed by appealing to reality (what actually happened). He develops this view of language by appealing to Saul Kripke's concept of the proper name as a "rigid designator" and by defining "reality" in an original way. Proper names pick our referents in a way that is rigid and consistent but, according to Lyotard, empty of sense. For example, the name Fred may consistently pick out a particular person, but there are many different senses or meanings which may be attached to this person. Only phrases carry sense (i.e. tell us something meaningful about Fred). The proper name may fix reference, but does nothing to fix sense. The name acts as a point which links the referent and the many senses which may be attached to it. Lyotard then defines reality as this complex of possible senses attached to a referent through a name. The correct sense of a phrase cannot be determined by a reference to reality, since the referent itself does not fix sense and reality itself is defined as the complex of competing senses attached to a referent. The phrase event remains indeterminate.

Lyotard uses the concepts of a phrase universe and of the difference between presentation and situation in order to show how phases can carry meanings and yet be indeterminate. Every phrase presents a universe, composed of the following four elements or, as Lyotard calls them, instances:

  1. The sense (the possible meanings of the phrase)
  2. The referent (the thing to which the phrase refers)
  3. The addressor (that from which the phrase comes)
  4. The addressee (that to which the phrase is sent)

In the initial presentation of the phrase, the instances of the universe are equivocal. That is, there are many possible ways in which the instances may be situated in relation to each other. Who or what uttered the phrase, and to whom? To what does the phrase refer? What sense of the phrase is meant? This equivocation means that the meaning of the phrase is not fixed in the initial presentation, and only becomes fixed through what Lyotard calls situation. Situation takes place when the instances of the phrase universe are fixed through the concatenation of phrases. That is, when the phrase is followed by another phrase. When phrases are concatenated, they follow rules for linking called phrase regimens. Phrase regimens fix the instances of the phrase universe within a concatenation; these regimens are syntactic types of phrases such as the cognitive, the descriptive, the prescriptive, the interrogative, the evaluative, and so on. Any situation of a phrase within a concatenation will only be one possible situation of the initial presentation of the phrase, however. It is always possible to situate the phrase in a different way by concatenating with a different phrase regimen. In other words, the presentation of the phrase event is not able to be accurately represented by any particular situation. This also means that there is no "correct" way of concatenating a phrase, no correct phrase regimen to be employed in following one phrase with another.

Lyotard insists that phrase regimens are heterogenous and incommensurable. That is, they are of radically different types and cannot be meaningfully compared through an initial presentation of the phrase event of which they are situations. However, different phrase regimens can be brought together through genres. Genres supply rules for the linking of phrases, but rather than being syntactic rules as phrase regimens are, genres direct how to concatenate through ends, goals, or stakes. What is at stake in the genre of comedy, for example, is to be humorous, to make people laugh. This goal directs how phrases are linked on from one to another. As an example, Lyotard suggests that the phrase "To arms!" might be followed by the phrase “You have just formulated a prescription" if the goal is to make people laugh, but not if the goal implied by the genre is to inspire direct action (such as may be the case if it is uttered by a military commander on a battlefield). Genres of discourse can bring heterogenous phrase regimens together in a concatenation, but genres themselves are heterogenous and incommensurable. This means that there is no "correct" genre in which to situate the initial phrase which is presented, and no genre has more validity than others. The differend arises on this level of genres when the phrase event gives rise to different genres, but one genre claims validity over the others. That is, one genre claims the exclusive right to impose rules of concatenation from the initial phrase.

How do we know when a differend has occurred? Lyotard says that it is signalled by the difficulty of linking on from one phrase to another. A differend occurs when a discourse does not allow the linkages which would enable the presentation of a wrong. Lyotard insists that phrases must, of necessity, follow other phrases - even silence is a kind of phrase, with its own generic effects. A silent phrase in the context of a dispute may be covering four possible states of affairs, corresponding to each of the instances in the phrase universe:

  1. The sense: The meaning of the referent cannot be signified.
  2. The referent: The referent (the wrong, etc.) did not take place.
  3. The addressor: The addressor does not believe that the referent falls within the competence of him/her self to present.
  4. The addressee: The addressor does not believe that the referent (the wrong, etc.) falls within the competence (to hear, to understand, to judge, etc.) of the addressee.

In order for the referent to be expressed, these four silent negations must be withdrawn. The referent must have reality, must be presentable in the rules of the discourse, and the addressor must have confidence in the competence of both him/her self and the addressee. Through the idea of the differend, Lyotard has drawn particular attention to the problems of the presentability of the referent when the parties in dispute cannot agree on a common discourse, or rule of judgement (i.e. cannot agree on the genre(s) of phrase linkage). Justice demands, however, that wrongs be presented - we must at least try to "present the unpresentable." How is this possible? Lyotard does not believe that there is any easy answer. But for the sake of justice, we must try. We must identify differends as best we can - sometimes, no more than vague feelings attest to the existence of a differend. It may be the feeling of "not being able to find the words." Lyotard associates the identification of a differend with the feeling of the sublime, the mixture of pleasure and pain which accompanies the attempt to present the unpresentable. He privileges art as the realm which is best able to provide testimony to differends through its sublime effects [see Reason and Representation; Politics; Art and Aesthetics].

5. Reason and Representation

Lyotard's philosophy frequently calls into question the powers of reason, rejecting many of the claims that have been made about it in the history of philosophy. The limitations of reason are particularly evident for Lyotard in regard to the problems of representation. Since Descartes, the dominant model of rational thought in Western philosophy has been that of the human subject representing the objective world to its self. It has frequently been claimed that in this way complete and certain knowledge is possible, at least in theory. Lyotard calls such claims into doubt through his thesis that events exceed representation. Furthermore, Lyotard draws attention to the fact that reason tends to operate with structured systems of concepts which exclude the sensual and emotional, but that these exclusions can never be entirely maintained. On the one hand, any representation will miss something of the event, and on the other, non-rational forces such as feelings and desires will arise to disrupt rational schemas of thought.

Lyotard's analysis of the limits of reason and representation is played out in Discours, figure through the terms of the discursive and the figural. The discursive is the term used for reason and representation here; it is the rational system of representation by concepts that forms a system of oppositions. The figural is what exceeds rational representation; it appeals to sensual experience, emotions and desires. Lyotard uses the metaphors of flatness and depth to refer to discourse and figure, respectively. The opposition between discourse and figure is deconstructed, however, since to maintain it as an opposition would be to remain within the logic of discourse (and to retain discourse as primary). Lyotard introduces a distinction between opposition and difference to account for the differing ways in which the discursive and the figural function. Difference corresponds to figure, and the distinction between discourse and figure itself is said to be one of difference rather than opposition. In opposition, two terms are rigidly opposed and quite distinct; in difference, the two terms are mutually implicated, yet ultimately irreconcilable. Difference is a disruptive force at the limits of discourse, indicating that no rational system of representation can ever be closed or complete, but is always opened up to forces (sensual, emotional, figural) that it cannot enclose within itself.

In Discours, figure, Lyotard takes structuralism (still a dominant intellectual trend in France in the early seventies when the book was written) as an example of the excesses of reason and representation. Structuralism seeks to explain everything in terms of underlying, conditioning structures that take the form of rigid systems of oppositions. His aim is to show that structuralism ignores the figural elements at work both outside and within representational structures. Lyotard shows that discourse and figure are mutually implicated (thus deconstructing the opposition) by examining the relationship of Ferdinand de Saussure's linguistics and Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenology. For Saussure, language is a "flat" system of opposing terms that gain meaning from each other, rather than from referents outside the system. Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology suggests that we experience the world on a pre-cognitive level as ambiguous and somewhat chaotic sense data which must be synthesized by the perceiving subject in order to structure the world in a meaningful way. Saussure's linguistics suggests that our understanding of the world is given as a structure to begin with, while Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology suggests that we first encounter an unstructured world, which we must work to structure. Drawing on Merleau-Ponty's phenomenological analysis of the depth of the visual field, Lyotard posits an interruption of the supposedly flat system of language by this depth. This takes place through the deictic terms in language (such as here, now, I, you, this) which gain meaning by referring to temporal and spatial specificities in the world of the language-user. The discursive structure of language, therefore, needs reference at some points to sensual experience. The opposition is further deconstructed by Lyotard's insistence that our experience of space may also be structured in a discursive fashion. Space can be broken into ordered elements related to each other in a structured and organised way, such as by mapping it with a three dimensional grid. A rigid theory of how the body interacts with space, as Merleau-Ponty may arguably be accused of developing, also exhibits structuralist tendencies. This leads Lyotard to a criticism of phenomenology as well, on the grounds that its descriptions of the body in the world are also too structural and do not account for the disruptive force of the figural. Lyotard sees Lacan's application of Saussurean linguistics to psychoanalysis as particularly worrisome. He attacks Lacan's famous dictum that 'the unconscious is structured like a language’ on the grounds that it is an over-rationalisation that posits representational structures to the exclusion of the figural. Returning to Freud, Lyotard develops a theory of libidinal forces as figural, as disruptive of reason and representation.

Reason and representation are further "critiqued" in the libidinal philosophy of Libidinal Economy and the related essays, although here the very idea of critique itself is called into question, since insofar as it remains theory, it remains within the oppositional logic of representational rationality. Rather than opposing the libidinal to the rational, then, Lyotard develops his theory of dissimulation, the mutual enfoldment of the libidinal and the rational which is similar to the deconstructive logic of difference worked out in Discours, figure. Lyotard's main criticism of representation in the libidinal philosophy is that it is nihilistic. He draws an analogy between representational structures and Friedrich Nietzsche's characterisation of religion and transcendental philosophy as forms of nihilism. For Nietzsche religion is nihilistic because it places the highest values (as the ground for all values) in a transcendent realm which cannot be accessed, thereby cutting us off from the highest values and devaluing the realm of our actual experience. According to Lyotard, representational theory follows this model by placing the reality that representation refers to in a transcendent realm. Lyotard expresses this nihilism in terms of what he calls "the Great zero." This zero is the divide between representation and what it represents. Representation is nihilistic because it can never close the divide between representation and reality, effectively cutting off representational thought from access to reality. What is represented is constantly deferred. For Lyotard semiotics is a prime example of representational nihilism, because the definition of the sign is that it replaces something (negating that which it replaces).

In the libidinal philosophy Lyotard does not reject theory and representation itself as necessarily nihilistic; rather, it is representational theory's own understanding of itself - how it represents itself – that is the focus of Lyotard’s attack. Instead of opposing theory with alternative practises which are more libidinal, Lyotard asserts that theory itself is a libidinal practice which denies that it is libidinal. The nihilistic aspect of representational theory is this denial of the libidinal. Theory attempts to be detached and "cold," and takes itself to be a stable and consistent structure which represents stable structures in the world. Lyotard's response to the nihilism of representational theory is not to propose an "other" to it (which he believes is impossible), but to inscribe theory itself into the libidinal economy. It is the concept of dissimulation which makes this possible. Systems dissimulate affects. Representational theory is itself a libidinal dispositif, and Lyotard accentuates the libidinal aspects of theory in order to combat its nihilistic tendencies. Against the nihilism of the semiotic sign Lyotard proposes a reinterpretation of the sign: the tensor. The tensor is a duplicitous sign. One of its sides (or potentialities) is the semiotic sign; this side is the potential to be inscribed in an existing structure of meaning. The other side of the tensor contains residual potentialities for other meanings. This side of the tensor disrupts and escapes the system, flowing into new systems and structures. The tensor expresses the theory of dissimulation at work in the sign. We might think of the tensor as the semiotic sign dissimulating affects which might disrupt its meaning and flow into new systems.

The critique of reason and representation shift in Lyotard's postmodern philosophy from a focus on the figurative and libidinal forces which disrupt systems to an analysis of incommensurability in language and the limits of the rational faculty. Lyotard uses Wittgenstein's idea of language games to show that reason and representation cannot be totalizing. The end of metanarratives means that no single overarching theory can pretend to account for everything. Rather, the postmodern condition is composed of fragmented language games attached to incommensurable forms of life. For Lyotard language is composed of a multiplicity of phrase regimes which cannot be translated into each other. Some are descriptive, some prescriptive, etc. These phrase regimes have no outside criteria for comparison. Between them lies the differend, an absolute difference which cannot be reconciled. In Lyotard's postmodern philosophy, then, reason and representation are set limits by the incommensurability of language games; it is not possible for reason to understand everything through a representational system. In the postmodern philosophy events are analyzed as phrases, and again Lyotard asserts that events exceed representation in that no representational system can account for all phrases.

Furthermore, Lyotard's postmodernism draws attention to the limits of reason through its focus on the sublime. The differend is experienced as a feeling of not being able to find the words to express something; it signals the limits of one language game or phrase regime and the attempt to move on to another one. Lyotard analyses this experience in terms of Kant's idea of the sublime, which is itself an experience of the limits of reason. In Kant's philosophy, the sublime is the mixed feeling of pleasure and pain that we feel in the face of something of great magnitude and grandeur. We can have an idea of such things, but we cannot match up that idea with a direct sensory intuition since sublime objects surpass our sensory abilities. An example of a sublime object for Kant would be a mountain; we can have an idea of a mountain, but not a sensory intuition of it as a whole. We feel pain at the frustration of our faculties to fully grasp the sublime object, but a pleasure as well in the attempt to do so. Lyotard extends the notion of the sublime from that which is absolutely great to all things which confound our abilities to synthesize them into knowledge. Thus the sublime is situated at the differend between language games and phrase regimes; we feel a mixture of pleasure and pain in the frustration of not knowing how to follow on from a phrase but feeling that there is something important that must be put into words. In Lyotard's postmodern philosophy the sublime is the feeling that indicates the limits of reason and representation.

6. The Subject and the Inhuman

Like many other prominent French thinkers of his generation (such as Michel Foucault, Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze), Lyotard develops critiques of the subject and of humanism. Lyotard's misgivings about the subject as a central epistemological category can be understood in terms of his concern for difference, multiplicity, and the limits of organisational systems. For Lyotard the subject as traditionally understood in philosophy acts as a central point for the organisation of knowledge, eliminating difference and disorderly elements. Lyotard seeks to dethrone the subject from this organisational role, which in effect means decentring it as a philosophical category. He sees the subject not as primary, foundational, and central, but as one element among others which should be examined by thought. Furthermore, he does not see the subject as a transcendent and immutable entity, but as produced by wider social and political forces. In the libidinal philosophy, the subject is construed as one organisational structure or dispositif which channels and exploits libidinal energies. Like other structures which threaten to be hegemonic, Lyotard proposes its disruption through the release of the libidinal forces it contains which are not consistent with it. That is, the opening of the subject to forces which are deemed irrational, such as feelings and desires. Furthermore, Lyotard's insistence that the freeing of dissimulated libidinal forces can only be passively done and not actively controlled is motivated by his identification of wilful acts with the organisational subject.

In Lyotard's postmodern philosophy, the fragmentation of language games also means the social subject fragments and seems to dissolve. The subject cannot be seen as a master of language games, a unifying power, but is rather a node at which different incommensurable language games intersect. Lyotard furthermore asserts that avant-garde art works of the twentieth century do not reinforce the subject, but call it into question through the unsettling effect of the sublime. Humanism is also called into question in Lyotard's later philosophy through the term "Inhuman." Lyotard objects to humanism on the grounds that it depends upon a definition of the human which is exclusionary of difference. He asks why, if humanism is correct that there is a human nature, we are not born human but rather have to go through a terroristic education in order to become acceptably human. The term "Inhuman" has two meanings for Lyotard. Firstly, it refers to the dehumanising effects of science and technology in society. Secondly, it refers to those potentially positive forces that the idea of the human tries to repress or exclude, but which inevitably return with disruptive effects. Lyotard tries to show the limit of the humanistic ideal by imagining a science-fiction-like scenario in which, in 4.5 billion years time when our sun explodes, the human race will have developed the ability to survive without the Earth. In one sense this survival is the humanist dream (since survival is essential for the central importance of the human race in the universe), but in another sense it might constitute the end of the human, since the changes required to survive in space would be so radical as to erase anything we currently recognise as human. On the one hand Lyotard criticises the dehumanising effects of the progress of science and technology that are themselves bound up with the idea of human progress, and on the other he affirms the dehumanising forces that open up our thinking to more than a simple definition of the human.

7. Science and Technology

Lyotard develops some reflections on science and technology within the scope of his postmodern philosophy [see The Postmodern Condition]. The changing status of science and technology is a primary feature of the postmodern condition, and Lyotard calls certain new forms of science postmodern. His concern with an ontology of events and a politics of competing representations of those events underlies his theorization of science and technology in postmodernity, in which the collapse of metanarratives has meant the proliferation of multiple, incommensurable language games (of which science is only one). We should interpret Lyotard as taking this to be a good thing, since such a proliferation more accurately reflects his general ontological view of the world as composed of events which give rise to multiple interpretations, and which can never be accurately captured by a single narrative. Metanarratives do violence to alternative representations of events that are valid in their own right. Lyotard sees the rise of capital, science and technology linked through legitimation by performativity as a similar threat, however. He calls this threat "terrorism": the threat of exclusion from playing a language game.

The principle of legitimation functioning in capitalism is efficiency or performativity [see The Postmodern Condition], and this principle attempts to be hegemonic. Science and technology are prime candidates for this attempted hegemony, since they contribute to the growth of capital. Lyotard accepts that performativity is a legitimate criterion for technology, but argues that it is not proper to science. He develops his argument around what he calls postmodern science, by which he means recent sciences such as Benoit Mandelbrot's fractal theory and Rene Thom’s catastrophe theory that search for instabilities rather than regularities in systems. Following to some extent philosophers of science Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend, Lyotard argues that the performativity criterion does not accurately capture the kind of knowledge developed in the sciences nor the way such knowledge develops. For Lyotard, science is a language game to which legitimation by performativity is not proper. Such performativity merely subordinates science to capital. According to Lyotard, it is the idea of a deterministic system that allows performativity in science, since determinism allows the prediction and calculation of input/output values.

Postmodern science, however, does not function according to a legitimation by performativity precisely because it undermines determinism. Postmodern science searches for instabilities in systems, undermining predictability. Lyotard cites thermodynamics as the beginning of performativity in terms of determinism, and suggests that quantum mechanics and atomic physics have limited the applicability of this principle. Postmodern sciences, which concern themselves with undecidables, the limits of precise control, conflicts characterized by incomplete information, "fracta," catastrophes, and pragmatic paradoxes, continue to undermine performativity in the form of determinism. Furthermore, postmodern science is undermining legitimation by performativity by retheorizing the way science itself develops: science does not develop in a progressive fashion and towards a unified knowledge, but in a discontinuous and paradoxical manner, undermining previous paradigms by the development of new ones. This is what Lyotard calls legitimation by paralogy. He suggests that science may be undergoing a paradigm shift from deterministic performativity to the paralogy of instabilities. Yet this is only a possibility: performativity still looms large on the horizon. Lyotard suggests science could go either way. He champions paralogy over performativity, since it contributes to healthy research in the sciences and undermines the hegemonic control capital attempts to have. Postmodern science is about the generation of new ideas rather than the efficient application of existing knowledge.

Lyotard is also concerned about the social impact of science and technology in postmodernity. He sees the performativity criterion as applying not just to science, technology, and capital, but to the State as well. According to the performativity criterion, society is seen as a system which must aim for efficient functioning, and this efficiency is a kind of terror which threatens to exclude inefficient elements. Furthermore, in post-industrial society information has become a primary mode of production, and Lyotard is concerned that in the interests of maximising profits information will become increasingly privatised by corporations. He proposes the possibility of IBM having exclusive control of databases and satellites. In response to these threats, Lyotard proposes that the public be given free access to memory and data banks. This will allow computerization to contribute to knowledge functioning by paralogy rather than by performativity, and to the free functioning of society as a set of heterogenous elements rather than an efficient system, removing the threat of terror.

8. Politics

Lyotard's early political commitments were to revolutionary socialism and a relatively orthodox Marxism (see Biography and Early Works (b) Algeria). Despite his radical disillusion with these early political commitments, however, a strong political concern remains a central feature of all of Lyotard's mature works. Lyotard’s notion of the political, however, must be understood as quite distinct from that employed in much traditional and contemporary politics and political theory. Having rejected the possibility of a politics based on a single theory that will accurately capture the truth of all social events (such as Marxism), Lyotard's later concern is to do justice to multiple social realities. He is concerned with the free proliferation of heterogenous elements in society, and for him the institutions of politics and traditional political theory limit multiplicities and differences. Lyotard's politics can be traced back to his general concern for events and the limits of representation. There is a strong correlation between his concern that events are not done justice by any one theoretical, representational system, and his concern that events of political import are not done justice by the way any particular political party or philosophy represents them.

The politics of the libidinal philosophy revolves around a nuanced reading of Marx and a duplicitous relation to capitalism. While Lyotard has given up on the possibility and desirability of a socialist revolution, he is still interested in the deployment of revolutionary desires. Libidinal Economy contains a reading of Marx's texts as works of art, an emphasis which seeks to release the libidinal aspects of Marx, the desire for revolution. Lyotard's interpretation of capitalism in the libidinal economy sees two possibilities inherent in capitalism, each entwined and inextricable. On the one hand, capitalism is a good system for the circulation of libidinal energies; it encourages enterprising explorations of and investments in new areas. On the other hand, capitalism tends to hoard up libidinal energy into structured and regulated systems, restricting its flow. This latter tendency is at work in the capitalist exploitation that Marx rallied against. Lyotard interprets these two tendencies of capitalism in terms of the theory of dissimulation. For Lyotard, there is no possible society that is not open to the desire to exploit and hoard libidinal energy in the way the capitalist does. This means that there is no utopian society free from exploitation, either pre-capitalist or post-revolutionary. Lyotard's libidinal politics is not aimed at overthrowing capitalism, then, but of working within it to release the libidinal energies dissimulated within its structures. Practically, this also means working within existing political institutions, but "passively," so as to release as much desire dissimulated within those institutions as possible, without constraining desires through planned outcomes.

Lyotard's postmodern politics involves the attempt to rethink the political after the death of metanarratives such as Marxism and liberalism. Lyotard rejects all dominant political ideologies as master-narratives which exclude minorities and do violence to the heterogenous nature of social reality. This rejection is manifested in the philosophy of paganism that preceded Lyotard's postmodernism. Here, the notion of "impiety" associated with the pagan is a rejection of “pious” political ideologies which unquestioningly assert principles and values as universally and unquestioningly true. In its mature form, Lyotard's postmodern politics deals with the concern for justice and the need to bear witness to the differend. In the case of a differend, a wrong is done to a party who cannot phrase their hurt (See Postmodernism (c) The Differend). For Lyotard, no just resolution of a differend is possible. Because of the radical incommensurability of phrase regimes in the case of a differend, any "resolution" would only assert the legitimacy of one phrase regime at the cost of silencing the other, thus deepening the wrong. Justice demands a witnessing and a remembering of the fact that there is a differend. This means presenting the fact that a wrong has been done which cannot itself be presented. This is then the contradictory task of presenting the unpresentable, a task Lyotard sees as best accomplished in the arena of art.

9. Art and Aesthetics

Lyotard was a prolific writer on both art and philosophical aesthetics. An aesthetic theory focusing on the avant-garde deeply informs both major phases of his philosophical thought (the libidinal and the postmodern). Examples from particular movements in art and individual artists and writers are common in his philosophical works, and in addition he wrote a number of books on individual artists, including Georges Guiffrey, Albert Ayme, Gian-franco Baruchello, Jacques Monory, Valerio Adami, Shusaku Arakawa, and Daniel Buren. Lyotard also organised an art exhibition, Les immatériaux, at the Centre Georges Pompidou in 1985. The exhibition collected works which explored connections between the media, art, space, and matter.

Art has a privileged place in Lyotard's philosophy of events, since it calls attention to the limits of representation. In the earlier phase of his work, art is celebrated for its figural and libidinal aspects that oppose and deregulate systems of discourse and rational thought. In Lyotard's postmodern period, art is privileged for its sublime effects and the attention it calls to the differend. It is not all kinds of art that Lyotard celebrates; he is particularly interested in the avant-garde. Some forms of art can reinforce structured systems of meaning, but the special feature of avant-garde art is to disrupt expectations, conventions, and established orders of reception. In Discours, figure, visual arts are associated with the figural and the process of seeing. However, poetry is also privileged as a manifestation of the figural in the way it upsets established orders of meaning, following Lyotard's move from the figural as simply sensuous to the figural as disruptive force in any system. The libidinal philosophy engages with art on the level of its affective force: shapes and colours act as tensors within the system of signification that the artwork forms, and unlike more rigidly structured systems, artworks more readily release their affective energy into different systems of interpretation, reception, and influence. Furthermore, the process of painting exemplifies the ambiguously passive yet active way in which Lyotard sees the release of libidinal energies as most effective. A painting is not a rigidly pre-planned structured piece of work in which the outcome is determined beforehand, but a process of experimentation. In this process, affects are inscribed on a surface without being strictly controlled by an actively willing and organising subject. The most important artists for Lyotard in this period include Paul Cézanne, Marcel Duchamp, and Robert Delaunay.

In Lyotard's philosophy of postmodernism and the differend, he develops an aesthetic theory of postmodern art. It is essential to distinguish Lyotard's concept of postmodern art from other ideas of postmodern art. There are many theories of postmodernism in the arts, literature, architecture, and other areas of cultural practise. Other theorists (such as Jean Baudrillard) have also proposed aesthetic theories of postmodernism which differ from Lyotard's understanding of postmodernism in the arts. In particular, Lyotard's postmodern art must be distinguished from the stylistic trends often called postmodern in the art world (such as the anti-modern return to representational realism or the simulationism of Peter Halley, Sherrie Levine, Jeff Koons and others). Lyotard's concept of postmodernism in the arts relates more to what is usually called modernism in the arts. It focuses on the experimentation of the avant-garde, and Lyotard takes as privileged examples Abstract Expressionism and particularly the work of Barnett Newman. Lyotard makes his own distinction between the categories of modern and postmodern in art, however, in a couple of ways. Firstly, postmodernism is said to be the avant-garde movement always at work within modernism itself. It is that which is so new and different it can only be called modern in retrospect. In this sense, postmodernism is the spirit of experimentation that drives modernism into ever-changing forms; it is the disruptive force that unsettles accepted rules for reception and meaning. For Lyotard something must be postmodern before it can become modern. That is, it must be unsettling before it becomes an accepted norm.

Secondly, however, according to Lyotard postmodern avant-garde art never entirely loses its ability to disturb. This power of disturbance is related to the feeling of the sublime, and it is an indication of the differend. In this context, modern and postmodern art can be distinguished in the following way. Both are concerned with the unpresentable: that which cannot be presented (or represented) in art. Modern art, however, presents the fact that there is an unpresentable, while postmodern art attempts to present the unpresentable. This is a paradoxical task, and arouses in the viewer the mixture of pleasure and pain that is the sublime. Lyotard takes Barnett Newman's work as a paragon of postmodern, avant-garde art. Newman consciously seeks to achieve the sublime in his paintings, and Lyotard believes he achieves this by making his viewers feel that something profound and important is going on in his works, but without being able to identify what this is. Postmodern art has a political importance for Lyotard, since it can call attention to differends through the feeling of the sublime, showing us that a wrong has been done. Bearing witness to the differend is the primary focus of Lyotard's postmodern politics, and art is the privileged arena in which this witnessing takes place.

10. Late Works

a. Malraux

Two of Lyotard's latest works were on the French writer, activist, and politician, André Malraux. Signed, Malraux is an unconventional autobiography. Lyotard's philosophical commitments distance him from the presuppositions underlying the traditional genre of biography, where the subject is assumed to be unified and the text is taken to represent the truth about that subject. Lyotard instead takes Malraux as a set of heterogenous elements (texts, political activities, personal relationships, etc), which he, as author, consciously unifies through the creation of a fictional character. Lyotard's interest in Malraux may be explained through the commonalities they share, in particular a problematic relation to the political and an attempted solution to this problem through art. Soundproof Room: Malraux's Anti-Aesthetics situates Malraux’s work in a nihilist and abjectivist tradition of writers that includes Louis Céline, Georges Bataille, Antonin Artaud, and Albert Camus. What these writers share is a concern with the decline of belief in objective values (the "death of God") and the strangeness and nausea of the human body.

b. Augustine

The Confession of Augustine was incomplete at the time of Lyotard's death, and has been published posthumously in partial form, with working notes appended. At first glance this somewhat cryptic, poetic, and quasi-religious work seems to bear little resemblance to any other piece in Lyotard's oeuvre. On closer inspection, however, the themes Lyotard works through in his reading of Augustine's Confessions can be recognised as those already touched on in earlier works. The discussion of signs recalls Lyotard's analysis of the nihilism of semiotics in Libidinal Economy, where he refers to Augustine, and what is perhaps the main theme of this work - Augustine's writing as a study in the phenomenology of time – is referred to in the earlier paper "The Sublime and the Avant-Garde." Lyotard reads Augustine as the precursor to the phenomenological studies of time developed by Edmund Husserl, Martin Heidegger, and Jean-Paul Sartre. This study problematises the temporal mode of the 'now', the present, in its relations to the past and the future. The problematic of time is a recurring feature in Lyotard's work, and thus The Confession of Augustine can be seen as a further investigation into one of Lyotard's ongoing concerns.

11. References and Further Reading

The following is a list of books by and about Lyotard available in English. For further bibliographical references, including further original French editions, journal articles, and contributions by and about Lyotard, see Lyotard’s  Peregrinations and Joan Nordquist's Jean-François Lyotard: A Bibliography.

a. Books by Lyotard

  • Phenomenology, trans. Brian Beakley (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1991). Trans. of La Phénoménology (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1986). [1st. ed. 1954]
  • Discourse, Figure, trans. Antony Hudek and Mary Lydon (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 2011). Trans. of Discours, figure (Paris: Klincksieck, 1971).
  • Driftworks, ed. Roger McKeon (New York: Semiotext(e), 1984). Trans. of several essays from Dérive à partir de Marx et Freud (Paris: Union Général d’Editions, 1973) and Des Dispositifs Pulsionnels (Paris: Union Général d’Editions, 1973).
  • Libidinal Economy, trans. Iain Hamilton Grant (London: Athlone, 1993). Trans. of Économie libidinale (Paris: Minuit, 1974).
  • Duchamp’s TRANS/formers, ed. Herman Parret, trans. Ian McLeod. Jean-François Lyotard: Writings on Contemporary Art and Artists vol. III (Leuven: Leuven University Press, 2010). Bilingual edition with trans. of Les Transformateurs Duchamp (Paris: Galilée, 1977).
  • Pacific Wall, trans. Bruce Boone (Venice: Lapis Press, 1990). Trans. of Le Mur du Pacifique (Paris: Galilée, 1979).
  • (With Jean-Loup Thébaud) Just Gaming, trans. Wlad Godzick (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1985). Trans. of Au juste: conversations. (Paris: Bourgois, 1979).
  • The Postmodern Condition: A Report on Knowledge, trans. Geoff Bennington and Brian Massumi (Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1984). Trans. of La Condition postmoderne: rapport sur le savoir (Paris: Minuit, 1979).
  • The Differend: Phrases in Dispute, trans. Georges Van Den Abbeele (Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1988). Trans. of Le Différend (Paris: Minuit, 1983).
  • The Assassination of Experience by Painting, Monory, trans. Rachel Bowlby and Jeanne Bouniort, ed. Sarah Wilson (London: Black Dog, 1998). Bilingual edition with trans. of L'Assassinat de l'expérience par la peinture, Monory (Paris: Le Castor Astral, 1984). Also forthcoming as Vol. VI of Jean-François Lyotard: Writings on Contemporary Art and Artists (Leuven: Leuven University Press).
  • Enthusiasm: The Kantian Critique of History, trans. Georges Van Den Abbeele (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2009). Trans. of L'Enthousiasme: la critique kantienne de l'histoire (Paris: Galilée, 1986).
  • The Postmodern Explained to Children, ed. Julian Pefanis and Morgan Thomas (Sydney: Power Publications, 1992). Trans. of Le Postmoderne expliqué aux enfants: correspondance 1982-1985 (Paris: Galilée, 1986).
  • What to Paint? Adami, Arakawa, Buren, ed. Herman Parret. Jean-François Lyotard: Writings on Contemporary Art and Artists vol. V (Leuven: Leuven University Press, forthcoming). Bilingual edition with trans. of Que peindre? Adami. Arakawa. Buren (Paris: Éditions de la Différence, 1987).
  • Peregrinations: Law, Form, Event (New York: Columbia University Press, 1988).
  • Heidegger and “The Jews”, trans. Andreas Michel and Mark S. Roberts (Minneaplis: University of Minnesota Press, 1990). Trans. of Heidegger et “les juifs” (Paris: Galilée, 1988).
  • The Inhuman: Reflections on Time, trans. Geoffrey Bennington and Rachel Bowlby (Cambridge: Polity Press, 1991). Trans. of L'Inhumain: causeries sur le temps (Paris: Galilée, 1988).
  • Lessons on the Analytic of the Sublime: Kant’s Critique of Judgment, 23-29, trans. Elizabeth Rottenberg (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1994). Trans. of Leçons sur l'Analytique du sublime: Kant, Critique de la faculté de juger, 23- 29 (Paris: Galilée, 1991).
  • Sam Francis: Lesson of Darkness, trans. Geoffery Bennington, ed. Herman Parret. Jean-François Lyotard: Writings on Contemporary Art and Artists vol. II (Leuven: Leuven University Press, 2010). Bilingual edition. First edition: Sam Francis: Lesson of Darkness, trans. Geoffery Bennington (Los Angeles, CA: Lapis Press, 1993).
  • Postmodern Fables, trans. Georges Van Den Abbeele (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1997). Trans. of Moralités postmodernes (Paris: Galilée, 1993).
  • (with Eberhard Gruber) The Hyphen: Between Judaism and Christianity, trans. Pascale-Anne Brault and Michael Naas (Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanity Books, 1999). Trans. of Un trait d'union (Sainte-Foy, Quebec: Editions Le Griffon d'argile, 1994).
  • Signed Malraux, trans. Robert Harvey (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1999). Trans. of Signé Malraux: biographie (Paris: Grasset, 1996).
  • Karel Appel: A Gesture of Colour, ed. Herman Parret, trans. Vlad Ionescu and Peter W. Milne. Jean-François Lyotard: Writings on Contemporary Art and Artists vol. I. (Leuven: Leuven University Press, 2009). Bilingual edition. Original German edition: Karel Appel: Ein Farbgestus, Essays zur Kunst Karel Appels mit einer Bildauswahl des Autors (Berlin: Gachnang & Springer, Bern, 1998).
  • Soundproof Room: Malraux’s Anti-aesthetics, trans. Robert Harvey (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2001). Trans. of La Chambre sourde: L'Antiésthetique de Malraux (Paris: Galilée, 1998).
  • The Confession of Augustine, trans. Richard Beardsworth (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2000). Trans. of La Confession d'Augustin (Paris: Galilée, 1998).
  • The Lyotard Reader, ed. Andrew Benjamin (Oxford: Blackwell, 1989).
  • Toward the Postmodern, ed. Robert Harvey and Mark S. Roberts (New Jersey: Humanities Press, 1993).
  • Jean-François Lyotard: Political Writings, trans. and ed. Bill Readings and Kevin Paul Geiman (London: UCL, 1993).
  • The Lyotard Reader and Guide, Ed. Keith Crome and James Williams (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2006).
  • Miscellaneous Texts I: Aesthetics and Theory of Art, ed. Herman Parret, trans. Vlad Ionescu, Erica Harris and Peter W. Milne. Jean-François Lyotard: Writings on Contemporary Art and Artists vol. IVa (Leuven: Leuven University Press, 2012).
  • Miscellaneous Texts II: Contemporary Artists, ed. Herman Parret, trans. Vlad Ionescu, Erica Harris and Peter W. Milne. Jean-François Lyotard: Writings on Contemporary Art and Artists vol. IVb (Leuven: Leuven University Press, 2012).

b. Books about Lyotard

  • Benjamin, Andrew (ed.), Judging Lyotard (London: Routledge, 1992).
  • Bennington, Geoffrey, Lyotard: Writing the Event (Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1988).
  • Bennington, Geoffrey, Late Lyotard (CreateSpace, 2008).
  • Browning, Gary K., Lyotard and the End of Grand Narratives (Cardiff: University of Wales Press, 2000).
  • Carrol, David, Paraesthetics: Foucault, Lyotard, Derrida (London: Routledge, 1987).
  • Crome, Keith, Lyotard and Greek Thought: Sophistry (Houndmills, Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan, 2004).
  • Curtis, Neal, Against Autonomy: Lyotard, Judgement and Action (Aldershot, Hants & Burlington, VT: Ashgate, 2001).
  • Dhillon, Pradeep A. and Paul Standish, eds., Lyotard: Just Education (London & New York: Routledge, 2000).
  • Grebowicz, Margaret (ed.), Gender After Lyotard (Albany: SUNY, 2007).
  • Haber, Honi Fern, Beyond Postmodern Politics : Lyotard, Rorty, Foucault (New York : Routledge, 1994).
  • Harvey, Robert, ed., Afterwords: Essays in Memory of Jean-François Lyotard (Stony Brook, NY: Humanities Institute, 2000).
  • Harvey, Robert and Lawrence R. Schehr, eds., Jean-François: Time and Judgment (New Haven & London: Yale University Press, 2001).
  • Jones, Graham, Lyotard Reframed (London: I. B. Tauris, forthcoming).
  • Kearney, Richard, Poetics of Imagining: From Husserl to Lyotard (London: HarperCollins Academic, 1991).
  • Kilian, Monika, Modern and Postmodern Strategies: Gaming and the Question of Morality: Adorno, Rorty, Lyotard, and Enzensberger (New York: Lang, 1998).
  • Malpas, Simon, Jean-François Lyotard (New York: Routledge, 2002).
  • Nordquist, Joan, Jean-François Lyotard: A Bibliography (Santa Cruz, CA: Reference and Research Services, 1991).
  • Nouvet, Claire, Zrinka Stahuljak and Kent Still (eds.), Minima Memoria: Essays in the Wake of Jean-François Lyotard (Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press, 2006).
  • Pefanis, Julian, Heterology and the Postmodern Bataille, Baudrillard, and Lyotard (Durham: Duke University Press, 1991).
  • Peters, Michael (ed.), Education and the Postmodern Condition (Wesport, Connecticut & London: Bergin & Garvey, 1995).
  • Raffel, Stanley, Habermas, Lyotard and the Concept of Justice (London: Macmillan Press, 1992).
  • Readings, Bill, Introducing Lyotard: Art and Politics (London: Routledge, 1991).
  • Robbins, Derek (ed.), Jean-François Lyotard. 3 vols. (London; Thousand Oaks: Sage, 2004).
  • Rojeck, Chris and Turner, Bryan S. (ed.) The Politics of Jean-François Lyotard. (London: Routledge, 1998).
  • Sheilds, Rob and Heidi Bickis (eds.), Listening to the Late: New Encounters with Jean-François Lyotard (Surrey: Ashgate, forthcoming).
  • Silverman, Hugh J. (ed.), Lyotard: Philosophy, Politics and the Sublime (New York: Routledge, 2002).
  • Sim, Stuart, Jean-François Lyotard (New York: Prentice Hall/Harvester Wheatsheaf, 1995).
  • Sim, Stuart, Lyotard and the Inhuman (Cambridge: Icon/Totem, 2000).
  • Sim, Stuart (ed.), The Lyotard Dictionary (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2011).
  • Slade, Andrew, Lyotard, Beckett, Duras, and the Postmodern Sublime (New York: Peter Lang, 2007).
  • Steuerman, Emilia, The Bounds of Reason: Habermas, Lyotard, and Melanie Klein on Rationality (London & New York: Routledge, 2000).
  • Taylor, Victor E. and Gregg Lambert (eds.), Jean-François Lyotard: Critical Evaluations in Cultural Theory (London; New York: Routledge, 2005).
  • Williams, James, Lyotard: Towards a Postmodern Philosophy (Cambridge: Polity Press, 1998).
  • Williams, James, Lyotard and the Political (London: Routledge, 2000).
  • Woodward, Ashley, Nihilism in Postmodernity: Lyotard, Baudrillard, Vattimo (Aurora, Colorado: The Davies Group, 2009).

Author Information

Ashley Woodward
Email: phallacy@tpg.com.au
The Melbourne School of Continental Philosophy
Australia

Nasir Khusraw (1004—1060)

Abu Mo’in Hamid al-Din Nasir ibn Khusraw is an important figure in the development of Ismaili philosophy. Much of his biography and philosophical ideology has been obtained through fragmented texts, both in poetry and prose.  Born into a politically connected family, Khusraw was well-educated and in the sciences and humanities.  Having spent most of his life occupying prestigious positions within the Sajuq court, Khusraw converted to the Ismaili faith at the age of forty after careful study.  He spent the rest of his life writing and advocating for the Ismaili faith, and eventually was forced into exile by Sunni authorities.

Consistent with other Ismaili philosopher, Khusraw’s cosmology is heavily inspired by Neoplatonism.  His metaphysics describes a God from which everything emanates and consistently strives back towards.  Through God, existence is cast into being through Universal Soul and Universal Intellect.  Each of these concepts provides the foundation for material objects, ascending from minerals to human beings.  Within each human being exists a soul and intellect, imperfect in form but existing within the Universals.   Khusraw interweaves his metaphysics within the Shi’i doctrine, requiring a divinely inspired guide to assist us in our journey to reconnect with Universal Intellect and Soul.  In holding to this cosmogonic description, Khusraw distinguishes his philosophy from previous Ismaili thought introduced by al-Farabi and picked up by Ibn Sina and al-Kirmani.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

In striking contrast to other Ismaili writers of the time (s.v., Hamid ai-din al Kirmani; Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani), many sources of information exist pertaining to Khusraw’s life.   Documentation was recorded,  with vary degrees of accuracy, by Khusraw himself, a (hostile) contemporary, and by later historians.  Since his death, Khusraw has been included in every major literary or historical survey of Ismailism.  Khusraw's life can be divided into four periods: his early years up to the age of forty (discernible from fragments of various texts); his conversion to Ismailism (of which he has left two different versions in the form of prose and poetry); his seven-year journey (documented in Safarnama); and his years of preaching followed by persecution and exile (drawn primarily from his poetry, but also a few statements in his philosophical works).

In 1004, Abu Mo’in Hamid al-Din Nasir ibn Khusraw was born in Qobadiyan, the district of Marv, in the eastern Iranian province of Khurasan. Along with two of his brothers, Khusraw occupied a high position in the administrative ranks of the Saljuq court - reportedly in the revenue department.  Evidence also suggests that he was familiar with the court of previous dynasty, the Ghaznavids.  Based on the quality of his writings, he received an excellent education in the sciences, literatures and philosophies of his time, including the study of Greek and Neoplatonic philosophy.  In his writing, Khusraw reportes examining the doctrines of the different Islamic schools and not being satisfied until he found and understood the Ismaili faith.  As a result of his conversion to Ismailism he embarked on a seven-year journey, during which time he spent three years in the Ismaili court in Cairo under the Fatimid caliph, al-Mustansir (1029-1094). The Fatimid dynasty (909-1171) aimed at creating an Islamic state based on Ismaili tenets, and thus presented a direct theological and military challenge to the Sunni ‘Abbasid caliphate based in Baghdad. Khusraw left Cairo as the head (hujjat) of Ismaili missionary activities in his home province of Khurasan.  After leaving Cairo, Khusraw was forced into exile by the Sunni authorities.  He spent the rest of his life exiled in the Pamir Mountains in Badakhshan, located in modern-day Tajikistan and Afghanistan.

2. Philosophy

Khusraw’s philosophical works reveal a strong Neoplatonic structure and vocabulary.  For example, his cosmogony closely follows Plotinus, moving from God and God’s word (logos) to Intellect, Soul, and the world of Nature.  Underlying each of the Ismaili cosmogonic systems is a fundamental division of the world into two realms, the esoteric (batin) and the exoteric (zahir).  From this division, everything in the physical world points to its counterpart in the spiritual, which is seen as its source, or true form.  The cosmogonic structure itself reveals a purposeful, providential unfolding from the spiritual realm into the physical world.  Conversely, as a reflection, the physical world seeks to grasp the spiritual realm and comprehend it.    In holding to this cosmogonic description, Khusraw follows his fellow Ismailis (Nasafi and al-Sijistani) while differentiating his theory from the structure introduced by al-Farabi and later adopted by Ibn Sina and the Ismaili philosopher al-Kirmani.

Khusraw begins with a discussion of tawhid (oneness, God’s unity), the clear understanding of which is the only way to achieve spiritual perfection. For Nasir, God Himself is indescribable beyond all categories of being and non-being (nothing which has an opposite can be ascribed to Him, since that would be limiting Him to human concepts).   However, from God emerges his Word (kalmia), ‘Be!’, which brings into existence Universal Intellect, perfect in potentiality and actuality.  Universal Intellect transcends time and space,  containing all being within itself.  Universal Intellect enjoys a worshipful intimacy with God and derives perfection from this intimacy.  From this worship emerges Universal Soul, perfect in potentiality but not in actuality because it is separated from God by Intellect.  Universal Soul recognizes its separation from God, and moves closer to God in a desire for the perfection enjoyed by Intellect.  Through its search for perfection, Universal Soul introduces the first movement into the entire structure, manifest in time and space.

The entire cosmos is set into motion through the movement of Universal Soul.  As a corollary, being is differentiated into two sets of opposites:  hot and cold, wet and dry.  Derived from these sets of opposites are the four elements: earth, air, fire, and water.  From these four elements arise the successive development of   minerals, plants, and animals.  Finally, as the summit of physical creation, human beings arise.  Within each human being exists an individual intellect and individual soul manifesting the same characteristics (but on a smaller level) as the universals.  In fact, the entire cosmos is formed on a matrix of Intellect and Soul; everything within the cosmos displays original intelligence and the search for perfection exhibited by the soul.

Khusraw’s ethics grow from and reflect this cosmogony. Each individual’s task is to recognize his or her own imperfections and then move to correct them, seeking the closest relationship possible with God.  For Khusraw, this is achieved by stringent and repeated application of the intellect to both physical and spiritual matters.  In order to correct these imperfections a believer must find a guide and study dilligently, perform all required religious acts with a full understanding, and supplement new understanding with higher levels of worldly activity.  As an Ismaili, Khusraw held the Shi‘i doctrine that God would not send a revelation without a guide to interpret it.  For the Ismailis, this guide must be a living person, the Imam of the Time.  As a living bridge between the two realms, this person must be divinely inspired, infallible, and perfectly capable of providing guidance in spiritual and worldly affairs.

3. References and Further Reading

The following sources elucidate Khusraw’s philosophy:

  • H. Corbin, "Nasir-i Khusrau and Iranian Ismailism," in The Cambridge History of Iran: Volume 4, ed., R. N. Frye (Cambridge 1975), pp. 520-42 and 689-90;
  • A. Hunsberger, "Nasir Khusraw: Fatimid Intellectual," in F. Daftary, ed., Intellectual Traditions in Islam (London 2000), pp. 112-29;
  • A. Hunsberger, Nasir Khusraw’s Doctrine of the Soul: From the Universal Intellect to the Physical World in Ismaili Philosophy, PhD thesis, Columbia University, New York, 1992;
  • S. Meskoob, Shahrokh, "The Origin and Meaning of ‘Aql (Reason) in the View of Nasir Khusraw," Iran Nameh, 6 (1989), pp. 239-57, and 7 (1989), pp. 405-29.

For a full bibliography of Nasir Khusraw’s works and ideas, see:

  • A. C. Hunsberger, Nasir Khusraw, the Ruby of Badakhshan: A Portrait of the Persian Poet, Traveller and Philosopher (London 2000).

For works still in manuscript, see:

  • I. K. Poonawala, Bibibliography of Ismaili Literature, Malibu, Calif., 1977, p. 123.

Author Information

Alice C. Hunsberger
Email: info@iis.ac.uk
Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Justus Lipsius (1547—1606)

LipsiusJustus Lipsius, a Belgian classical philologist and Humanist, wrote a series of works designed to revive ancient Stoicism in a form that would be compatible with Christianity. The most famous of these is De Constantia (‘On Constancy’) in which he advocated a Stoic-inspired ideal of constancy in the face of unpleasant external events, but also carefully distinguished those parts of Stoic philosophy that the orthodox Christian should reject or modify. This modified form of Stoicism influenced a number of contemporary thinkers, creating an intellectual movement that has come to be known as Neostoicism.

Lipsius has been described as the greatest Renaissance scholar of the Low Countries after Erasmus. The role that he played in the revival of interest in Stoicism during the late Renaissance was similar to that performed by Marsilio Ficino with regard to Platonism and Pierre Gassendi with regard to Epicureanism. As such, he stands as a key figure in the history of Renaissance philosophy and the Renaissance revival of ancient thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
  2. Life
  3. Works
    1. Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex
    2. De Constantia Libri Duo
      1. Form
      2. Analysis of Contents
      3. Definition of constantia
      4. Four Arguments Concerning Public Evils
      5. Four Modifications of Ancient Stoicism
      6. Summary
    3. Later Stoic Works
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Background

Justus Lipsius's philosophical reputation rests upon his status as the principal figure in the Renaissance revival of Stoicism. Stoicism was one of the great Hellenistic schools of philosophy and dominated ancient intellectual life for at least 400 years. Founded by Zeno of Citium around 300 B.C.C., the school developed under Cleanthes, Chrysippus, Panaetius, and Posidonius. In the first century B.C. it appealed to high-ranking Romans including Cicero and Cato. In the first two centuries C.E. it reached its height of popularity under the influence of Musonius Rufus and Epictetus. In the second century C.E. it found its most famous exponent in the form of the Roman Emperor Marcus Aurelius. However, after the second century Stoicism was soon eclipsed in popularity by Neoplatonism.

Despite this decline in late antiquity, Stoicism continued to exert an influence. Its ideas were discussed by Church Fathers such as St. Augustine, Lactantius, and Tertullian. In the Middle Ages its impact can be seen in the ethical works of Peter Abelard and his pupil John of Salisbury, transmitted via the readily available Latin works of Seneca and Cicero. In the fourteenth century Stoicism attracted the attention of Petrarch who produced a substantial ethical work entitled De Remediis Utriusque Fortunae ('On the Remedies of Both Kinds of Fortune') inspired by Seneca and drawing upon an account of the Stoic theory of the passions made by Cicero. With the rediscovery of the works of the Stoic philosopher Epictetus by famous Humanists such as Perotti and Politian in the fifteenth century, interest in Stoicism continued to develop. However, the Renaissance revival of Stoicism remained somewhat limited until Justus Lipsius.

2.Life

Justus Lipsius (the Latinized version of Joest Lips) was born in Overyssche, a village near Brussels and Louvain, in 1547. He studied first with the Jesuits in Cologne and later at the Catholic University of Louvain. After completing his education he visited Rome, in his new position as secretary to Cardinal Granvelle, staying for two years in order to study the ancient monuments and explore the unsurpassed libraries of classical literature. In 1572 Lipsius's property in Belgium was taken by Spanish troops during the civil war while he was away on a trip to Vienna (a trip that would later be used as the backdrop for the dialogue in De Constantia over a decade later). Without property, Lipsius applied for a position at the Lutheran University of Jena. This was the first of a number of institutional moves that required Lipsius to change his publicly professed faith. His new colleagues at Jena remained sceptical of this radical transformation and Lipsius was eventually forced to leave Jena after only two years in favour of Cologne. While at Cologne he prepared notes on Tacitus that he used in his critical edition of 1574.

In 1576 Lispius returned to Catholic Louvain. However after his property was looted by soldiers a second time he fled again in 1579, this time to the Calvinist University of Leiden. He remained at Leiden for thirteen years and it is to this period that his two most famous books - De Constantia Libri Duo (1584) and Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex (1589) – belong. However, Lipsius was by upbringing a Catholic and eventually he sought to return to Louvain, via a brief period in Liège. In 1592 Lipsius accepted the Chair of Latin History and Literature at Louvain. To this final period belong his editorial work on Seneca and his two detailed studies of Stoicism, the Manuductio ad Stoicam Philosophiam and Physiologia Stoicorum. The two studies were published first in 1604 and the edition of Seneca in 1605. Lipsius died in Louvain in 1606.

Among Lipsius's friends was his publisher, the famous printer Christopher Plantin, with whom he often stayed in Antwerp. Among his pupils was Philip Rubens, brother of the painter Peter Paul Rubens who portrayed Lipsius after his death in 'The Four Philosophers’ (c. 1611, now in the Pitti Palace, Florence). Among his admirers was Michel de Montaigne who described him as one of the most learned men then alive (Essais 2.12).

3. Works

Lipsius was a prolific author, publishing his first work Variarum Lectionum Libri IV ('Four Books of Various Readings') - a collection of philological comments and conjectures – in 1569, while still in his twenties. His reputation today is primarily as a Latin philologist and stands upon his critical editions of Tacitus and Seneca. He also produced a number of philological studies and a large correspondence, some of which he published. His principal philosophical works are De Constantia Libri Duo and Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex, complementing his editions of Seneca and Tacitus respectively.

a. Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex

In his Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex ('Six Books on Politics or Civil Doctrine') Lipsius drew upon a wide range of classical sources, with a particular emphasis upon Tacitus, and the work has been characterized, not unfairly, as not much more than a compendium of quotations. In it he argued that no State should permit more than one religion within its borders and that all dissent should be punished without mercy. Experience had taught him that civil conflict enflamed by religious intolerance was far more dangerous and destructive than despotism.

The treatise is concerned with the creation of civil life, defined as 'that which we lead in the society of men, one with another, to mutual commodity and profit, and common use of all' (Pol. 1.1). Such a life has two necessary conditions, virtue (virtute) and prudence (prudentia). Book One is devoted to an analysis of these two conditions: virtue requires piety and goodness; prudence is dependent upon use and memory. Book Two opens by arguing that government is necessary for civil life and that the best form of government is a principality. Civil concord requires all to submit to the will of one. ‘Principality’ (principatus) is defined as ‘rule by one for the good of all’ (Pol. 2.3). For the Prince to achieve this he himself must have both virtue and prudence. The remainder of Book Two is devoted to princely virtues, the most important being justice and clemency. Book Three moves on to consider princely prudence, and this remains the theme for the rest of the work. There are two types of prudence, one’s own and the advice of others. Book Three focuses upon prudent advisors in the form of counsellors and ministers. Book Four is concerned with a Prince’s own prudence, which must be carefully developed in the light of experience. This itself may be divided into civil and military prudence. The rest of Book Four outlines two types of civil prudence, that concerned with matters divine and that concerned with matters human. Military Prudence is the subject of Books Five and Six. Book Five deals with external military prudence (war with foreign powers), while Book Six deals with internal military prudence (civil war).

The central theme of the work is clear from the outset. Lipsius - pre-empting Hobbes – places order and peace far above civil liberties and personal freedom. Individual political rights are little consolation when surrounded by violent anarchy. The first task for politics is to secure peace for all and this can only be done if power is concentrated in one individual. It can also only be achieved if only one religion is allowed in any particular State. If one has concerns about such a concentration of power, the proper way to reduce them is to educate the holder of power, to develop his virtue and prudence, and to remind him that he holds power in order to secure peace, not to create terror. If a Prince forgets this last point and turns into a tyrant, there may be grounds to challenge his position. However Lipsius emphasizes that there is nothing more miserable than civil war which should be avoided at all costs.

b. De Constantia Libri Duo

Lipsius's principal philosophical work is De Constantia Libri Duo ('Two Books on Constancy’), published in 1584. The title is borrowed from Seneca’s dialogue De Constantia Sapientis. This work was immensely popular and went through numerous editions. It was translated into English four times between 1594 and 1670. It for this work that Lipsius became famous in the succeeding centuries, inspiring the intellectual movement that has come to be known as Neostoicism. This work was conceived as an attempt to revive Stoic philosophy as a living movement as it had been in antiquity and, in particular, as a practical antidote to public evils.

i. Form

The work takes the form of a dialogue between Lipsius and his friend Langius (Charles de Langhe, Canon of Liège). This no doubt fictional conversation is set within the context of a visit to Langius by Lipsius during the course of a trip to Vienna that Lipsius had actually undertaken in 1572. While some distance from his troubled homeland, the dialogue's character Lipsius reflects upon the nature of public evils (mala publica) and is guided by the older and wiser Langius into whose mouth the positive content of the dialogue is placed.

ii. Analysis of Contents

The dialogue is divided into two books. However a single structure operates throughout the entire work. The opening chapters of Book One introduce the idea that in order to escape public evils one must change one's mind, not one’s location (Const. 1.1-3). The concept of constancy is introduced as that which must be cultivated in the mind in order to achieve such a change (Const. 1.4-7). After a brief survey of the enemies of constancy (Const. 1.8-12), the four central arguments of the work, concerning the nature of public evil, are introduced (Const. 1.13). The first two of these arguments occupy the remainder of Book One (Const. 1.14 and 15-22). After a brief interlude at the beginning of Book Two on the nature of the philosophical project at hand (Const. 2.1-5), the remaining two arguments follow (Const. 2.6-17 and 18-26). The final chapter functions as a summary (Const. 2.27).

iii. Definition of constantia

The central concept in this work is, not surprisingly, constancy (constantia). It is introduced in Const. 1.4 and defined as a right and immovable strength of mind, neither elated nor depressed by external or chance events. The mother of constancy is patience (patientia), defined as a voluntary endurance without complaint of all things that can happen to or in a man.

However key to both of these concepts is the distinction between reason (ratio) and opinion (opinio). While opinion leads to inconstancy, it is reason that is able to form the foundation for constancy. Cultivating reason is thus the way in which one can reach the goal of constancy. Here Lipsius draws upon relatively common Stoic ideas concerning the passions or emotions (affectus; in Greek, pathê). Emotions are the product of mere opinions and lead to distress and imbalance. Analysing and rejecting those opinions in favour of rational understanding will free one from emotions and thus the inconstancy that they create. The wise man who enjoys constancy will be free from emotions such as desire (cupiditas), joy (gaudium), fear (metus), and sorrow (dolor).

iv. Four Arguments Concerning Public Evils

The core of De Constantia is the series of four arguments concerning the nature of public evils. These are outlined in Const. 1.13 and then developed, in turn, in Const. 1.14, 1.15-22, 2.6-17, and 2.18-26. It is argued that public evils are (a) imposed by God; (b) the product of necessity; (c) in reality profitable to us; (d) neither grievous nor unusual.

The first argument claims that all public evils form part of God's divine plan. They derive form the same source as all those profitable parts of nature and it would be impious to take only part of God’s creation and criticise Him for the remainder. We are born into God’s creation and it is our duty to obey Him by accepting all of His works. In any case, even if one does not follow God’s will freely, one will nevertheless be drawn along forcibly (echoing the famous Stoic donkey and cart analogy reported in Hippolytus Refutatio 1.21). Thus the only option is to obey God (deo parere).

The second argument claims that the continual cycle of creation and destruction are the inevitable consequence of the necessary laws of Nature. If even the stars in the heavens are subject to the processes of creation and destruction, then it is only natural that man-made cities will rise and fall, for "all things run into this fatal whirlpool of ebbing and flowing" (Const. 1.16). However Lipsius is careful here to distance himself from Stoic materialism and outlines four points where Stoic doctrine must be modified in the light of Christian truth (see the next section).

The third argument is merely a variation upon traditional Christian responses to the problem of evil. Those terrible things that happen must in some sense be good if they are part of God's divine plan and Lipsius attempts to show this by claiming that public evils constitute exercise (exercendi) for the good, correction (castigandi) for the weak-willed, and punishment (puniendi) for the bad.

The fourth argument focuses upon the particular public evils that Lipsius wanted to avoid, namely the religious civil wars in the Low Countries. He argues that these wars are neither particularly grievous nor uncommon. In order to place these present conflicts into perspective Lipsius, drawing upon his extensive classical learning, cites numerous examples of wars, plagues, and acts of cruelty from Jewish, Greek, and Roman history. The conflict from which Lipsius has fled is neither excessively brutal nor particularly unusual. What would be unusual would be an individual insulated and exempted from the cycles of birth and death, creation and destruction. It is the human lot to suffer at the hands of this continual change; the philosophical task, however, is to decide how one will face that suffering. One can do so either with sorrow (dolor) or with constancy (constantia).

v. Four Modifications of Ancient Stoicism

During the course of the second argument concerning the nature of public evils, Lipsius outlines four points where Stoicism and Christianity diverge. He is careful to distance himself from these parts of Stoic philosophy and the modification of Stoicism that he makes here (Const. 1.20) in order to reconcile it with Christianity forms the basis for the intellectual movement that has come to be known as Neostoicism. The four points in question are the Stoic claims that (a) God is submitted to fate; (b) that there is a natural order of causes (and thus no miracles); (c) that there is no contingency; (d) that there is no free will. All four of these points derive from the Stoic theory of determinism and it is this to which Lipsius primarily objects.

Stoic determinism is itself built upon Stoic materialism, which affirms that only bodies exist. These bodies act as causes and so anything that acts, including the soul, must be corporeal. Aulus Gellius reports that the Stoic Chrysippus defined fate as a natural and everlasting order of causes in which each event follows from another in an unalterable interconnection (Noctes Atticae 7.2.3). Thus, as Cicero notes, the Stoic doctrine of fate, conceived as an order and sequence of material causes, is "not the fate of superstition but rather that of physics" (De Divinatione 1.126). By rejecting this doctrine, Lipsius attempts to disengage the Stoic ethical ideas to which he is drawn from their foundations in Stoic physics. This is absolutely essential if he is to be able to present Stoic ethics in a form acceptable to a Christian audience.

vi. Summary

The central theme of De Constantia - that public evils are the product of the mind and thus must be treated rather than fled – contrasts sharply with Lipsius's own earlier behaviour when faced with the religious wars then raging. Perhaps experience had taught him that, no matter how many geographical moves he made, he would not be able to escape the evils surrounding him until he examined himself. Only wisdom and constancy – the products of philosophical reflection – can bring true peace of mind.

c. Later Stoic Works

De Constantia was not Lipsius's only work devoted to Stoicism. He also produced two studies of Stoic philosophy during the course of the preparation of his 1605 edition of Seneca; the Manuductio ad Stoicam Philosophiam ('Digest of Stoic Philosophy’) and the Physiologia Stoicorum (‘Physics of the Stoics’), both published in 1604. These works offer an interpretation of every aspect of Stoic philosophy and draw together under subject headings large numbers of quotations and doxographical reports preserved in a wide range of ancient authors. These two works may be seen as the precursors to the, now standard, edition of the fragments of the early Stoics compiled by Hans von Arnm (Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta, 1903-24).

These later studies of Stoicism - based upon a more systematic survey of the surviving sources – are marked by two features which distinguish them from De Constantia. The first is a more developed awareness of the systematic inter-relation between ethics and physics in Stoic philosophy; the second is a revised and more positive attitude towards the Stoic theory of determinism. In Phys. 1.12, for instance, Lipsius demonstrates a more thorough understanding of the Stoic theory of fate, and on the basis of this he suggests that it can in fact be reconciled with Christian doctrine without modification. In order to do this, he draws upon St. Augustine's discussion of Stoic definitions of fate in De Civitate Dei 5.8 where it is argued that fate does not impinge upon the power of God but rather is the expression of the will of God.

While De Constantia was a popular and highly readable dialogue, these later studies were primarily works of classical scholarship. They were conceived as supplementary volumes designed to complement - and perhaps even justify – Lipsius's final great work, his 1605 critical edition of the philosophical works of Seneca. This handsome folio edition included all of Seneca’s prose works, detailed summaries for each, commentary, and a biography of the great Roman Stoic. In this final publication, Lipsius’s admiration of Stoic philosophy and his talents as a classical philologist are united so as to form a highly appropriate culmination to his intellectual career.

4. Conclusion

Lipsius has been described as the greatest Renaissance scholar of the Low Countries after Erasmus. The role that he played in the revival of interest in Stoicism during the late Renaissance was similar to that performed by Marsilio Ficino with regard to Platonism and Pierre Gassendi with regard to Epicureanism. As such, he stands as a key figure in the history of Renaissance philosophy and the Renaissance revival of ancient thought.

5. References and Further Reading

a. The Works of Justus Lipsius

All of Lipsius's works are gathered together in his Opera Omnia of 1637. Another edition appeared in 1675. Full bibliographical details for all of his works can be found in F. Van Der Haeghen’s Bibliographie Lipsienne: Oeuvres de Juste Lipse, 2 vols (Ghent: Université de Gand, 1886).

i) Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex

  • Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex (Leiden: Plantin, 1589) - the first edition.
  • Sixe Bookes of Politickes or Civil Doctrine, Done into English by William Jones (London: Richard Field, 1594) - there is also a facsimile reprint of this edition (Amsterdam: Theatrum Orbis Terrarum, 1970).

ii) De Constantia Libri Duo

  • De Constantia Libri Duo, Qui alloquium praecipue continent in Publicis malis(Antwerp: Plantin, 1584) - the first edition.
  • Traité de la constance, Traduction nouvelle précédée d'une notice sur Juste Lipse par Lucien du Bois (Brussels & Leipzig: Merzbach, 1873) - still the most recent edition of the Latin text, with a facing French translation.
  • Two Bookes of Constancie Written in Latine by Iustus Lipsius, in English by Sir John Stradling, Edited with an Introduction by Rudolf Kirk (New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press, 1939) - the most recent edition in English, reprinting a translation first published in 1594.

iii) Later Stoic Works

  • Manuductionis ad Stoicam Philosophiam Libri Tres, L. Annaeo Senecae, aliisque scriptoribus illustrandis (Antwerp: Plaintin-Moretus, 1604) - extracts reprinted and translated into French in Lagrée (below) – extracts also translated into English in J. Kraye, ed. Cambridge Translations of Renaissance Philosophical Texts 1: Moral Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), 200-09.
  • Physiologiae Stoicorum Libri Tres, L. Annaeo Senecae, aliisque scriptoribus illustrandis (Antwerp: Plantin-Moretus, 1604) - extracts reprinted and translated into French in Lagrée (below).
  • Annaei Senecae Philosophi Opera, Quae Existant Omnia, A Iusto Lipsio emendata, et Scholiis illustrata (Antwerp: Plantin-Moretus, 1605) - Lipsius's 'Life of Seneca’ and his summaries are translated by Thomas Lodge in his The Workes of Lucius Annaeus Seneca (London: William Stansby, 1620), which is based upon Lipsius’s edition.

b. Studies

  • ANDERTON, B., 'A Stoic of Louvain: Justus Lipsius', in Sketches from a Library Window (Cambridge: Heffer, 1922), 10-30.
  • GERLO, A., ed., Juste Lipse (1547-1606), Travaux de l'Institut Interuniversitaire pour l’étude de la Renaissance et de l’Humanisme IX (Brussels: University Press, 1988)
  • LAGRÉE, J., Juste Lipse et la restauration du stoïcisme: Étude et traduction des traités stoïciens De la constance, Manuel de philosophie stoïcienne, Physique des stoïciens (Paris: Vrin, 1994)
  • LAGRÉE, J. 'Juste Lipse: destins et Providence', in P.-F, Moreau, ed., Le stoïcisme au XVIe et au XVIIe siècle (Paris: Albin Michel, 1999), 77-93.
  • LAGRÉE, J. 'La vertu stoïcienne de constance', in P.-F, Moreau, ed., Le stoïcisme au XVIe et au XVIIe siècle (Paris: Albin Michel, 1999), 94-116.
  • LAUREYS, M., ed., The World of Justus Lipsius: A Contribution Towards his Intellectual Biography, Bulletin de l'Institut Historique Belge de Rome LXVIII (Brussels & Rome: Brepols, 1998)
  • LEVI, A. H. T., 'The Relationship of Stoicism and Scepticism: Justus Lipsius', in J. Kraye and M. W. F. Stone, eds, Humanism and Early Modern Philosophy (London: Routledge, 2000), 91-106.
  • MARIN, M., 'L'influence de Sénèque sur Juste Lipse’, in A. Gerlo, ed., Juste Lipse: 1547-1606 (Brussels: University Press, 1988), 119-26.
  • MORFORD, M., Stoics and Neostoics: Rubens and the Circle of Lipsius (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1991)
  • MORFORD, M. 'Towards an Intellectual Biography of Justus Lipsius - Pieter Paul Rubens', Bulletin de l’Institut Historique Belge de Rome 68 (1998), 387-403.
  • OESTREICH, G., Neostoicism and the Early Modern State, trans. D. McLintock (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982)
  • SAUNDERS, J. L., Justus Lipsius: The Philosophy of Renaissance Stoicism (New York: The Liberal Arts Press, 1955)
  • ZANTA, L., La renaissance du stoïcisme au XVIe siècle (Paris: Champion, 1914)

References to further works dealing with Neostoicism may be found at the end of the IEP article Neostoicism.

Author Information

John Sellars
Email: john.sellars (at) wolfson.ox.ac.uk
University of the West of England
United Kingdom

Lucretius (c. 99—c. 55 B.C.E.)

LucretiusLucretius (Titus Lucretius Carus) was a Roman poet and the author of the philosophical epic De Rerum Natura (On the Nature of the Universe), a comprehensive exposition of the Epicurean world-view. Very little is known of the poet’s life, though a sense of his character and personality emerges vividly from his poem. The stress and tumult of his times stands in the background of his work and partly explains his personal attraction and commitment to Epicureanism, with its elevation of intellectual pleasure and tranquility of mind and its dim view of the world of social strife and political violence. His epic is presented in six books and undertakes a full and completely naturalistic explanation of the physical origin, structure, and destiny of the universe. Included in this presentation are theories of the atomic structure of matter and the emergence and evolution of life forms – ideas that would eventually form a crucial foundation and background for the development of western science. In addition to his literary and scientific influence, Lucretius has been a major source of inspiration for a wide range of modern philosophers, including Gassendi, Bergson, Spencer, Whitehead, and Teilhard de Chardin.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
    1. Italy during the First Century BCE
    2. Lucretius' Personality and Outlook
  2. Philosophy
    1. Epicurus
    2. Epicureanism
      1. Physics
      2. Canonic
      3. Ethics
    3. The Design of the Poem
    4. Lucretius as a Philosopher
    5. Influence and Legacy
    6. Conclusion
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Texts
    2. English Translations
    3. Critical and Scholarly Studies

1. Life

Of Lucretius' life remarkably little is known: he was an accomplished poet; he lived during the first century BC; he was devoted to the teachings of Epicurus; and he apparently died before his magnum opus, De Rerum Natura, was completed. Almost everything else we know (or think we know) about this elusive figure is a matter of conjecture, rumor, legend, or gossip.

Some scholars have imagined that this lack of information is the result of a sinister plot - a conspiracy of silence supposedly conducted by pious Roman and early Christian writers bent on suppressing the poet's anti-religious sentiments and materialist blasphemies. Yet perhaps more vexing for our understanding of Lucretius than any conspiracy of silence has been the single lurid item about his death that appears in a fourth century chronicle history by St. Jerome:

94

[sic] BC. . . The poet Titus Lucretius is born. He was later driven mad by a love philtre and, having composed between bouts of insanity several books (which Cicero afterwards corrected), committed suicide at the age of 44.

Certainly the possibility that Lucretius (whose blistering, two hundred line denunciation of sexual love comprises one of the memorable highlights of the poem) may himself have fallen victim to a love potion is a superb irony. Unfortunately, there is not a shred of evidence to support the claim. Nor is it highly likely that Cicero (a skeptical-minded thinker with sympathies toward Stoicism) would have assisted to any large degree in the publication of an epic celebrating the Epicurean creed. As for the suggestion that Lucretius produced De Rerum Natura in lucid periods between intervals of raging insanity, the poem itself stands as a strong argument to the contrary. At the very least it must be considered improbable that a work of such scope and complexity, of such intellectual depth and sustained reasoning power, could have been the product of fitful composition and a diseased mind.

Fortunately, even if we dismiss Jerome's account as little more than an edifying fable and resign ourselves to the absence of even a scrap of reliable biographical information on Lucretius, there is still one source we can turn to for valuable insights into the poet's character, personality, and habits of mind, and that is De Rerum Natura itself. For although the poem tells us almost nothing about the day to day affairs of Lucretius the man, it nevertheless furnishes a large and revealing portrait of Lucretius the poet, philosopher, social commentator, critic of religion, and observer of the world.

Indeed one does not have to read very far into the poem to discover that not only is Lucretius a serious student of philosophy and science, but that above all he is a great poet of nature. He reveals himself as a lover of woods, fields, streams, and open spaces, acutely sensitive to the beauties of landscape and the march of seasons. He proves a keen observer of plants and animals and at least as knowledgeable and interested in crops, weather, soil, and horticulture as in the existence of gods or the motion of atoms. The preponderance of natural descriptions and images in the poem has led some readers to suppose that the author must have led some form of rural existence, perhaps as the owner of a country estate. True or not, it is clearly not the city, with its hurly-burly of commerce, money grubbing, social climbing, and political strife, but the quiet countryside with its contemplative retreats, solitude, and simple pleasures that inspires his poetry and (as was the case with his master Epicurus in his garden at Athens) his philosophical reveries.

It is generally assumed that the poet, as his name implies, was a member of the aristocratic clan of the Lucretii. On the other hand, it is also possible that he was a former slave and freedman of that same noble family. Support for the idea of his nobility comes in part from his suave command of learning and the polished mastery of his style, but mostly from the easy and natural way (friend to friend, rather than subordinate to superior) in which he addresses Memmius, his literary patron and the addressee of the poem.

Gaius Memmius was a Roman patrician who was at one time married to Sulla's daughter, Fausta. In 54 BC (one year after Lucretius' death), he stood for consul, but was defeated owing to an electoral violation, which he himself revealed but was afterwards condemned for. In 52 BC he went into exile at Athens, and it is unknown whether he ever returned to Rome. Lucretius dedicated his poem to him, and throughout the epic the poet is at pains to remind Memmius of the sweet rewards of the Epicurean lifestyle and the bitter tribulations of public life. No doubt it would have distressed the poet deeply to know that his chief literary sponsor, instead of following the lofty path to Epicurean tranquilitas, ended his career with a vain descent into the tarnishing world of power politics and personal ambition.

Literary tradition has supplied Lucretius with a wife, Lucilla. However, except for a line or two in the poem suggesting the author's personal familiarity with marital discord and the bedroom practices of "our Roman wives" (4. 1277), there is no evidence that he himself was ever married.

a. Italy during the First Century BCE

For the most part, the forty-four years of Lucretius' lifetime was a period of nearly non-stop violence: a time of civil wars, grueling overseas campaigns, political assassinations, massacres, revolts, conspiracies, mass executions, and social and economic chaos. Even a brief chronology of the times paints a grim picture of devastation, with each decade bearing witness to some new disturbance or uprising:

100 BC: riots erupt in the streets of Rome; two public officials, the tribune L. Appuleius Saturninus and praetor C. Servilius Glaucia, are murdered. 91 BC: the so-called Social War (between Rome and her Italian allies) breaks out. No sooner is this bitter struggle ended (88 BC) than Lucius Cornelius Sulla, a ruthless politician and renegade army commander, marches on Rome, and an even more convulsive and bloody Civil War begins. 82 BC: Sulla becomes dictator. His infamous proscription results in the arrest and execution of more than 4000 leading citizens, including 40 senators. 71 BC: Spartacus' massive slave revolt (involving an army of 90,000 former slaves and outlaws) is finally put down by Cassius and Pompey. More than 6000 of the captured rebels are crucified and their bodies left for display along the Appian Way. 62 BC: Defeat and death of Catiline. By this point in his career this former lieutenant of Sulla had become a living plague upon Roman politics and a virtual byword for scandal, intrigue, conspiracy, demagoguery, and vain ambition.Such was Rome from the rise of Sulla to the fall of Catiline, a period of seemingly endless bloodshed and civil unrest. With such a background, it is little wonder that the precepts of Epicurus - with their emphasis on contemplative pursuits and quiet pleasures and severe strictures against ambition, fame, and the world of politics - struck a responsive chord in the heart of a young Roman poet. To a sensitive intellectual like Lucretius, the teachings of Epicurus must have had the force of a philosophical revelation. In this respect, it is noteworthy (and ironic) that throughout De Rerum Natura whenever the poet writes about Epicurus he praises him not simply as a great teacher and brilliant philosopher, but virtually as a kind of oracle and even a god. Meanwhile, he seems to have viewed his own role as that of an Epicurean evangelist: he is a poetic apostle dedicated to spreading the master's gospel of liberation from the bondage of superstition and error, of inner peace attained through the study of philosophy and the enjoyment of modest pleasures.

b. Lucretius' Personality and Outlook

Unlike his hero Epicurus, who had a reputation for being gentle and self-effacing, Lucretius' excitable personality springs vividly from his pages. Though naturally passionate and intellectually contentious, he also reveals himself as reflective and prone to melancholy. Like his master, he detests war, strife, and social tumult and favors a life quietly devoted to sweet friendship (suavis amicitia) and intellectual pleasures.

At the beginning of Book 2 of his poem, the poet compares the prospect of a person armed with the insights of Epicurus to that of a secure spectator looking down upon a scene of strife:

Pleasant it is, when over the great sea the winds shake the waters,
To gaze down from shore on the trials of others;
Not because seeing other people struggle is sweet to us,
But because the fact that we ourselves are free from such ills strikes us as pleasant.
Pleasant it is also to behold great armies battling on a plain,
When we ourselves have no part in their peril.
But nothing is sweeter than to occupy a lofty sanctuary of the mind,
Well fortified with the teachings of the wise,
Where we may look down on others as they stumble along,
Vainly searching for the true path of life. . . . (2. 1-10)

This idea of philosophy as a private citadel or quiet refuge in a world of anxiety and turmoil, or of some form of contemplation as the true path to enlightenment, has been a recurrent theme in world literature from the Buddha to Boethius, from Socrates to Schopenhauer. The idea is a central component of Epicurean doctrine and a favorite theme and image of Lucretius, whose characteristic vantage point throughout the poem is that of a critical observer above the fray. As narrator, he stands aloof, a scornful yet at the same time sympathetic witness to mankind's dark strivings and tribulations:

Lo, see them: contending with their wits, fighting for precedence,
Struggling night and day with unending effort,Climbing, clawing their way up the pinnacles of wealth and power.
O miserable minds of men! O blind hearts!
In what darkness, among how many perils,
You pass your short lives! Do you not see
That our nature requires only this:
A body free from pain, and a mind, released from worry and fear,
Free to enjoy feelings of delight? (2. 11-19.)

Like his master, Lucretius obviously feels that the true purpose of moral philosophy is not merely to diagnose human miseries; but to heal them.

2. Philosophy

a. Epicurus

From the very start of the poem, and especially in the opening lines of Book 3 (a ringing tribute to Epicurus), Lucretius makes it clear that his main purpose is not so much to display his own talents as to render accurately in a suitably sublime style the glorious philosophy of his master:

O you who out of the vast darkness were the first to raise
A shining light, illuminating the blessings of life,
O glory of the Grecian race, it is you I follow,
Tracing in your clearly marked footprints my own firm steps,
Not as a contending rival, but out of love, for I yearn to imitate you.
For why should the swallow vie with the swan?
Why should a young kid on spindly limbs
Dare to match strides with a mighty steed? (3. 1-8.)

The poetry, Lucretius keeps reminding his readers, is secondary, a sugar coating to sweeten Epicurus' healing medicine. The Epicurean system is what is important, and the poet pledges all his skill to presenting it as clearly, as faithfully, and as persuasively as possible. In his view nothing less than universal enlightenment and the liberation of mankind is at stake.

Epicurus was born at Samos, an Athenian colony, in 341 BC. Reduced to its simplest level, the goal of his teaching was to free humanity from needless cares and anxieties (especially the fear of death) . By furnishing a complete explanation of the origin and structure of the universe, he sought to open men's eyes to a true understanding of their condition and liberate them from ignorant fears and superstitions. Though by all accounts he was a voluminous writer, only a tiny fraction of his original output has survived, with the result that Lucretius' poem has served as one of the primary vehicles for conveying his thought.

b. Epicureanism

The Epicurean system consists of three linked components: Physics, Ethics, and Canonic. These three elements are designed to be interdependent, each one supposedly uniting with and reinforcing the other two. (To cite just one example, Epicurus' physics supposedly validates both the existence of free will and the fact that the soul disintegrates with the body, ideas that are crucial to Epicurean ethics. The canonic claims to validate the authority and reliability of sensation, which in turn serves as a basis for Epicurean physical theories and ethical views relating to pleasure and pain.) In actual fact, however, the three components are quite separable, and it is certainly possible, for example, to accept Epicurus' ethical doctrines while entirely denying his canonic teachings and physics.

i. Physics

One of the great achievements of the scientific imagination, the Epicurean cosmos is based on three fundamental principles: materialism, mechanism, and atomism. According to Epicurus the universe covers an infinitude of space and consists entirely of matter and void. For the most part the philosopher upholds Democritus' theory that all matter is composed of imperishable atoms, tiny indivisible particles that can neither be created or destroyed. He also shares Democritus' view that the atoms are infinite in number and homogenous in substance, while differing in shape and size. However, whereas Democritus held that the number of atomic sizes and shapes is infinite, Epicurus argued that their number, while large, is nevertheless finite. (As Lucretius notes, if atoms could be any size, some would be visible, and possibly even immense.) As for atomic motion, Democritus had claimed that the atoms move in straight lines in all directions and always in accordance with the iron laws of "necessity" (anangke). Epicurus, on the other hand, contends that their natural motion is to travel straight downwards at a uniform high velocity. At random and unpredictable moments, moreover, they deviate ever so slightly from their regular course, their resulting collisions thus occurring not by strict necessity but always with some element of chance. This theory of atomic "swerve" or clinamen is a crucial feature of the Epicurean world-view, providing (so Lucretius and other adherents believed) a firm physical foundation supporting the existence of free will.

Armed with these basic principles, Epicurus is able to explain the universe as an ongoing cosmic event - a never-ending binding and unbinding of atoms resulting in the gradual emergence of entire new worlds and the gradual disintegration of old ones. Our world, our bodies, our minds are but atoms in motion. They did not occur because of some purpose or final cause. Nor were they created by some god for our special use and benefit. They simply happened, more or less randomly and entirely naturally, through the effective operation of immutable and eternal physical laws.

Here it should be noted that Epicurus is a materialist, not an atheist. Although he argues that not only our earth and all its life forms, but also all human civilizations and arts came into being and evolved without any aid or sponsorship from the gods, he does not deny their existence. He merely denies that they have any knowledge of or interest in human affairs. They live on immune to destruction in their perfectly compounded material bodies in the serene and cloudless spaces between the worlds (intermundia), perfectly oblivious of human anxieties and cares. Lucretius imagines that Epicurus rivaled them in their divine tranquility.

ii. Canonic

The so-called canonic teachings of Epicurus (from the Greek kanon, "rule") include his epistemological theories and especially his theories of sensation and perception. In certain respects, these theories represent Epicurus' thought at its most original and prescient - and in one or two instances at its most fanciful and absurd.

The central principle of the canonic is that our sense data provide a true and accurate picture of external reality. Sensation is the ultimate source and criterion of truth, and its testimony is incontrovertible. Epicurus considered the reliability of the senses a bulwark of his philosophy, and Lucretius refers to trust in sensation as a "holdfast," describing it as the only thing preventing our slide into the abyss of skepticism (4. 502-512).

But if our sensory input is always true and dependable, how are we to account for hallucinations, fantasies, dreams, delusions, and other forms of perceptual error? According to Epicurus, such errors are always due to some higher mental process. They arise, for example, when we apply judgment or reasoning or some confused product of memory to the actual data presented to us by sensation. As Lucretius remarks, we deceive ourselves because we tend to "see some things with our mind that have not been seen by the senses":

For nothing is harder than to distinguish the real things of sense
From those doubtful versions of them that the mind readily supplies. (4. 466-468.)

Epicurus' theory of sensory perception is consistent with and follows from his materialism and atomism. Like Democritus, he postulates that external objects send off emanations or "idols" (eidola) of themselves that travel through the air and impinge upon our senses. In effect, these subtle atomic images or films imprint themselves on the senses, leaving behind trace versions of the external world (auditory and olfactory as well as visual) that can be apprehended and stored in memory. Once again, perceptual errors can occur in this process, but not because of any inherent problem with sensation itself. Instead, mistakes arise due either to the contamination of the "idols" by other atoms or because of the "false opinions" that we ourselves, through defects in our higher mental operations, introduce.

In short, unless it is distorted by some form of external "noise" or by some processing error attributable to reason, all information conveyed through the senses is true. This is Epicurus' core canonic teaching. Unfortunately, this belief in the infallibility of sense perception and the unreliability of logic and reason led him and his followers (including Lucretius) into a number of strange conclusions - such as the absurd claim that the sun, moon, and stars are exactly the size and shape that they appear to be to our naked eye. Thus (as strict Epicurean doctrine would have it) the moon truly is a small, silver disc, the sun is a slightly larger golden fire, and the stars are but tiny points of light.

iii. Ethics

Epicurus' ethics represents the true goal and raison d’etre of his philosophical mission, the capstone atop the impressive (though hardly flawless) pillars of his physics and epistemology. Like Socrates, he considered moral questions (What is virtue? What is happiness?) rather than cosmological speculations to be the ultimate concerns of philosophical inquiry.

As mentioned earlier, it is possible to accept one component of the Epicurean system without necessarily subscribing to the others. But from Epicurus' (and Lucretius’) point of view, it is the ethical component that is of vital importance.

As many commentators have noted, the term "Epicure" (in the sense of a self-indulgent bon vivant or luxurious pleasure-seeker) is entirely out of place when applied to Epicureanism in general and to its founder in particular. By all accounts, Epicurus' own living habits were virtually Spartan, and it is said that he attracted many of his disciples more by his solid character and agreeable temper than by his philosophical arguments. His moral philosophy is a form of hedonism, meaning that it is a system based on the pursuit of pleasure (Gr. 'ēdonewhich it identifies as the greatest good. But Epicurean hedonism is hardly synonymous with sensual extravagance; nor is it a matter (in St. Paul's disparaging terms) of "let us eat and drink; for tomorrow we die." It is instead a system that requires severe self-denial and moral discipline. For Epicurus places a much greater emphasis on the avoidance of pain than on the pursuit of pleasure, and he favors intellectual pleasures (which are long-lasting and never cloying) over physical ones (which are short-lived and lead to excess). As for self-indulgence, he argued that it is better to abstain from coarse or trivial pleasures if they prevent our enjoyment of richer, more satisfying ones.

In Epicurean ethics physical pain is the great enemy of happiness and is to be avoided in almost all cases. Mental anguish is even more threatening and potentially debilitating. It follows that the fear of death - and especially the superstitious belief in an after-life of eternal torment - can be particularly devastating source of anxiety and take a terrible toll on humanity, which is why Epicurus sets out so determinedly to crush it.

c. The Design of the Poem

De Rerum Natura is an epic in six books and is expertly organized to provide both expository clarity as well as powerful narrative and lyric effects. In one respect, the poem represents the unfolding of a complex philosophical argument, and in many places the poet is challenged to explain abstract and often extremely prosaic technical material in a lucid and lively way. (At times during the poem he complains about the relative poverty of Latin as a philosophical medium compared to the technical richness of Greek.) At the same time, he must be careful not to overwhelm or upstage his philosophical presentation with a surplus of brilliant literary devices and gaudy stylistic displays. The basic organization is as follows:

Book 1: The poem begins with a justly famous invocation to Venus (the poet's symbol for the forces of cohesion, integration, and creative energy in the universe). Presented as a kind of life principle, the Lucretian Venus is associated with the figure of Love (Gr. philia, the unifying or binding force in the philosophy of Empedocles, and also identified with her mythical role as Venus Genetrix, the patron goddess and mother of the Roman people. In the remainder of the book the poet begins the work of explaining the Epicurean system and refuting the systems of other philosophers. He starts by setting forth the major principles of Epicurean physics and cosmology, including atomism, the infinity of the universe, and the existence of matter and void.

Book 2. This book begins with a lyric passage celebrating the "serene sanctuaries" of philosophy and lamenting the condition of those poor human beings who struggle vainly outside its protective walls. The poet explains atomic motion and shapes and argues that the atoms do not have secondary qualities (color, smell, heat, moisture, etc.).

Book 3. After a glowing opening apostrophe to Epicurus ("O glory of the Greeks!"), the poet proceeds with an extended explanation and proof of the materiality - and mortality – of the mind and soul. This explanation culminates in the climactic declaration, "Nil igitur mors est ad nos. . ." ("Therefore death is nothing to us."), a stark, simple statement which effectively epitomizes the main message and central doctrine of Epicureanism.

Book 4. Following introductory verses on the art of didactic poetry, this book begins with a full account of Epicurus' theory of vision and sensation. It concludes with one of Lucretius' greatest passages of verse, his famous (and caustic) analysis of the biology and psychology of sexual love.

Book 5. Lucretius begins this book with another tribute to the genius of Epicurus, whose heroic intellectual achievements, it is argued, exceed even the twelve labors of Hercules. The remainder of the book is devoted to a full account of Epicurean cosmology and sociology, with the poet explaining the stages of life on earth and the origin and development of civilization. This book includes the remarkable passage (837-886) in which the poet offers his own evolutionary hypothesis on the proliferation and extinction of life forms.

Book 6. Though partly unfinished, this book contains some of Lucretius' greatest poetry, with effective technical explanations of meteorological and geologic phenomena and vivid descriptions of thunderstorms, lightning, and volcanic eruptions. The poem closes with a horrifying account of the great plague of Athens (430 BC), a grim reminder of universal mortality.

d. Lucretius as a Philosopher

Critics universally recognize Lucretius as a major poet and the author of one of the great classics of world literature. But in part because of his accepted role as a spokesperson for Epicureanism rather than an originator, it has been more difficult to assess his merit as a philosopher.

In this respect, it is noteworthy that at least two important philosophers have voiced strong support for Lucretius' status as a philosophical innovator and original thinker. In 1884, while still a young faculty member at the Blaise Pascal Lycee in Paris, the French philosopher Henri Bergson (1859-1941) published an edition of De Rerum Natura with notes, commentary, and an accompanying critical essay. Throughout this work, Bergson commends Lucretius not only as a poet of genius, but also as an inspired and "singularly original" thinker. In particular, he points out that in his view the poet's instinctive grasp of the physical operations of nature and his comprehensive, truly scientific world-view exceed anything found in the theories of Democritus and Epicurus.

The Spanish poet and Harvard philosopher George Santayana (1863-1952) held a similarly high opinion of Lucretius' power as a scientific thinker. Democritus and Epicurus, he argues, are mere sketch artists who offer no more than bare hints and vague outlines of a thoroughly imagined and truly scientifically conceived universe. It thus remained for the deeper, more visionary poet not just to flesh out their rough drafts in fine words, but in essence to actually create and give body to the entire Epicurean system. In Santayana's view, Epicurus was but a supplier of half-baked ideas; it was Lucretius who was the true creator of scientific materialism and the real founder of Epicureanism.

Hyperbole aside, what both Bergson and Santayana are pointing to is the frequently underrated and misunderstood role of imagination in the production of almost all major systems of philosophy. Great philosophers from Plato and Aristotle to Kant and Nietzsche (and Bergson himself) have never been simply logic mills or thinking machines, but bold thinkers with an imaginative "feel" for abstract reality. In this respect, even if we dismiss the assessments of Bergson and Santayana as extravagant, we can still accept Lucretius as a bona fide philosopher and not just as a poetical embellisher and interpreter.

Every philosopher has strengths and weaknesses; those of Lucretius are conspicuous. In addition to his powerful imagination, his main strength (not surprisingly) is his verbal skill and force of expression. He is one of the most quotable of philosophers, with a flair for striking images and tightly packed statements. A few samples:

On superstition:

"So powerful is religion at persuading to evil." 1. 101.

On luxuries:

"Hot fevers do not depart your body more quickly
If you toss about on pictured tapestries or rich purple coverlets
Than if you lie sick under a poor man's blanket." 2. 34-36.

On life without philosophy:

"All life is a struggle in the dark." 2. 54.
"After a while the life of a fool is hell on earth." 3. 1023.

On new truths:

"No fact is so obvious that it does not at first produce wonder,
Nor so wonderful that it does not eventually yield to belief." 2. 1026-27.

On reason:

"Such is the power of reason to overcome inborn vices
That nothing prevents our living a life worthy of gods." 3. 321-22.

On the language of love:

"We say a foul, dirty woman is 'sweetly disordered,'
If she is green-eyed, we call her 'my little Pallas';
If she's flighty and tightly strung, she’s 'a gazelle’;
A squat, dumpy dwarf is 'a little sprite,'
While a hulking giantess is 'divinely statuesque.'
If she stutters or lisps, she speaks 'musically.'
If she's dumb, she’s 'modest’; and if she’s hot-tempered
And a chatterbox, she's 'a ball of fire.’
When she's too skinny to live, she’s 'svelte,’
And she's 'delicate’ when she’s dying of consumption. . .
It would be wearisome to run through the whole list." 4. 1159-1171.

Of all Lucretius' intellectual strengths, perhaps none is more characteristic or stands out more impressively than his hard, clear commitment to naturalism. Throughout the poem he consistently attacks supernatural explanations of phenomena and resists the temptation to give in to some form of natural religion or "scientific" supernaturalism. The world, he argues, was not created by divine intelligence, nor is it imbued with any form of mind or purpose. Instead, it must be understood as an entirely natural phenomenon, the outcome of a random (though statistically inevitable and lawful) process. In short, whatever happens in the universe is not the product of design, but part of an ongoing sequence of purely physical events.

Lucretius' principal philosophical shortcoming is that not only will he occasionally follow Epicurean doctrine to the point of absurdity (e.g., the supposedly tiny size of the sun and moon) but he will also introduce logical fallacies or scientific errors of his own (such as his claim that the atoms travel faster than light - 2. 144ff.). As Bergson points out, these howlers can usually be attributed to the defective method of ancient science, which, because it did not require that hypotheses be confirmed by experimentation, allowed even the wildest conjectures to pass as plausible truths. One further problem is that, for all his reliance on naturalistic explanations and his attempted reduction of metaphysics to physics, Lucretius at times seems to back away, if only ever so slightly, from a purely materialist world view. Indeed in his effusive descriptions of the creative power of nature, effectively symbolized by the figure of Venus, he seems almost (like Bergson) to postulate an immaterial life-force surging through the universe and operating above or beyond raw nature. To read this romantic streak into him is clearly a mistake. Lucretius remains a thorough-going naturalist. Yet when his verse is in high gear, one almost gets the impression that somewhere inside this staunchly scientific, fiercely anti-religious poet there is a romantic nature-worshipper screaming to get out.

e. Influence and Legacy

Lucretius' literary influence has been long-lasting and widespread, especially among poets with epic ambitions or cosmological interests, from Virgil and Milton to Whitman and Wordsworth. Not surprisingly, as one of the main proponents and principal sources of Epicurean thought, his philosophical influence has also been considerable. The extent of his communication with and influence on his contemporaries, including other Epicurean writers, is not known. What is known is that by the end of the first century A.D. De Rerum Natura was hardly read and its author had already begun a long, slow descent into philosophical oblivion. It was not until the Renaissance, with the recovery of lost Lucretian manuscripts, that a true revival of the poet became possible.

It is probably an exaggeration to say that the restoration and study of Lucretius' poem was crucial to the rise of Renaissance "new philosophy" and the birth of modern science. On the other hand, one must not ignore its importance as a spur to innovative sixteenth- and seventeenth-century scientific thought and cosmological speculation. Greek atomism and Lucretius' account of the universe as an infinite, lawfully integrated whole provided an important background stimulus not only for Newtonian science, but also (if only in a negative or contrary way) for Spinoza's pantheism and Leibniz’s monadology.

Lucretius' influence on early modern thought is most directly visible in the work of the French scientist and neo-Epicurean philosopher Pierre Gassendi (1592-1655). In 1649 Gassendi published his Syntagma Philosophiae Epicuri, a theoretical refinement and elaboration of Epicurean science. A Catholic priest with a remarkably independent mind, Gassendi seemingly had no problem reconciling his personal philosophical commitment to atomism and materialism with his Christian beliefs in the immortality of the soul and the doctrine of divine providence.

Every modern reader of De Rerum Natura has been struck by the extent to which Lucretius seems to have anticipated modern evolutionary theories in the fields of geology, biology, and sociology. However, to acknowledge this connection is not to say that the poet deserves accredited status as some kind of scientific "evolutionist" or pre-Darwinian precursor. It is merely to point out that, however we choose to define and evaluate its influence, De Rerum Natura was from the 17th century onward a massive cultural presence and hence a ready source of evolutionary ideas. The poem formed part of the cultural heritage and intellectual background of virtually every evolutionary theorist in Europe from Lamarck to Herbert Spencer (whose hedonistic ethics also owed a debt to the poet) - including (though he claimed never to have read Lucretius' epic) Darwin himself.

Bergson's early study of Lucretius obviously played an important role in the foundation and development of his own philosophy. In 1907 Bergson published Creative Evolution, outlining his bold, new vitalistic theory of evolution, in opposition to both the earlier vitalism of Lamarck and the naturalism of Darwin, and Spencer. It is hard not to see in the French philosophers' concept of the élan vital a powerful life force akin to and strongly influenced by the immortal Venus of his great Latin predecessor. Bergson's evolutionary philosophy influenced the later "process" philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947) and the teleological scientific theories of Pierre Teilhard de Chardin (1881-1955), with the interesting result that it is possible to trace out a fairly direct, if unlikely, line of descent from Greek atomism through the pagan anti-spiritualist Lucretius to the Catholic naturalist Gassendi and then on, via the Jewish-Catholic Bergson, to the highly abstract theism of Whitehead and the "spiritualized" evolutionism of Father Teilhard. That Lucretius' ideas wound up two thousand years after his death influencing those of a godly British mathematical theorist and a highly original and even eccentric French scientist-priest is remarkable testimony to their durability, adaptability, and persuasive power.

f. Conclusion

In conclusion, it seems fair to say that, far from being a mere conduit for earlier Greek thought, the poet Titus Lucretius Carus was a bold innovator and original thinker who fully deserves the appellation of philosopher. While his literary fame clearly (and properly) comes first, and although his philosophical reputation is based largely (and again properly) on his role as one of the principle sources and prime exponents of Epicureanism, his own ideas, especially his evolutionary theories and his entirely naturalistic explanation of all universal phenomena, have exerted a long and important influence on western science and philosophy and should not be underestimated.

3. References and Further Reading

The most authoritative manuscripts of De Rerum Natura are the so-called O and Q codices in Leiden. Both date from the 9th century. Recently, however, scholars have deciphered a much older and previously illegible manuscript, consisting of papyri discovered in Herculaneum and possibly dating from as early as the first century AD. All other Lucretian manuscripts date from the 15th and 16th century and are based on the one (no longer extant) discovered in a monastery by the Italian humanist Poggio Bracciolini in 1417.

a. Texts

  • Lucretius: On the Nature of Things. W.H.D. Rouse, trans. Revised and edited by Martin F. Smith. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1992.
  • Bailey, C. ed. De Rerum Natura. 3 volumes with commentary. Oxford, 1947.

b. English Translations

  • Munro, H.A.J. (prose). Cambridge, 1864.Latham, R.E. (prose). Harmondsworth, UK: Penguin, 1951.
  • Humphries, Rolphe. (verse). Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1968.
  • Copley, Frank O. (verse). New York: Norton, 1977.

c. Critical and Scholarly Studies

  • Bergson, Henri. Philosophy of Poetry: The Genius of Lucretius. Wade Baskin, trans. New York: Philosophical Library, 1959.
  • Clay, D. Lucretius and Epicurus. Ithaca, NY, 1983.
  • Jones, H. The Epicurean Tradition. London: 1989.
  • Kenney, E. J. Lucretius. Oxford, 1977.
  • Santayana, George. Three Philosophical Poets. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Sikes, E.E. Lucretius: Poet and Philosopher. Cambridge, 1936.

Author Information

David Simpson
Email: dsimpson@condor.depaul.edu
DePaul University
U. S. A.

Mencius (c. 372—289 B.C.E.)

menciusBetter known in China as “Master Meng” (Chinese: Mengzi), Mencius was a fourth-century BCE Chinese thinker whose importance in the Confucian tradition is second only to that of Confucius himself. In many ways, he played the role of St. Paul to Confucius’ Jesus, interpreting the thought of the master for subsequent ages while simultaneously impressing Confucius’ ideas with his own philosophical stamp. He is most famous for his theory of human nature, according to which all human beings share an innate goodness that either can be cultivated through education and self-discipline or squandered through neglect and negative influences, but never lost altogether. While it is not clear that Mencius’ views prevailed in early Chinese philosophical circles, they eventually won out after gaining the support of influential medieval commentators and thinkers such as Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi, 1130-1200 CE) and Wang Yangming (1472-1529 CE). (See Romanization systems for Chinese terms.) Today contemporary philosophical interest in evolutionary psychology and sociobiology has inspired fresh appraisals of Mencius, while recent philological studies question the coherence and authenticity of the text that bears his name. Mencius remains a perennially attractive figure for those intrigued by moral psychology, of which he was the foremost practitioner in early China.

Table of Contents

  1. The Mencius of History
  2. The Mencius of the Text
  3. Theodicy
  4. Government
  5. Human Nature
  6. Teleology
  7. Virtue Theory
  8. Moral Psychology
  9. Key Interpreters of Mencius
  10. References and Further Reading

1. The Mencius of History

Like the historical Confucius, the historical Mencius is available only through a text that, in its complete form at least, postdates his traditional lifetime (372-289 BCE). The philological controversy surrounding the date and composition of the text that bears his name is far less intense than that which surrounds the Confucian Analects, however. Most scholars agree that the entire Mencius was assembled by Mencius himself and his immediate disciples, perhaps shortly after his death. The text records several encounters with various rulers during Mencius' old age, which can be dated between 323 and 314 BCE, making Mencius an active figure no later than the late fourth century BCE.

The other major source of information about Mencius' life is the biography found in the Shiji (Records of the Grand Historian) of Sima Qian (c. 145-90 BCE), which states that he was a native of Zou (Tsou), a small state near Confucius' home state of Lu in the Shandong peninsula of northeastern China. He is said to have studied with Confucius' grandson, Zisi (Tzu-ssu), although most modern scholars doubt this. He also is thought to have become a minister of the state of Qi (Ch'i), which also was famous as the home of the Jixia (Chi-hsia) Academy. The Jixia Academy was a kind of early Chinese "think tank" sponsored the ruler of Qi that produced, among other thinkers, Mencius' later opponent Xunzi (Hsun-tzu, 310-220 BCE).

Mencius was born in a period of Chinese history known as the Warring States (403-221 BCE), during which various states competed violently against one another for mastery of all of China, which once was unified under the Zhou dynasty until its collapse, for all intents and purposes, in 771 BCE. It was a brutal and turbulent era, which nonetheless gave rise to many brilliant philosophical movements, including the Confucian tradition of which Mencius was a foremost representative. The common intellectual and political problem that Warring States thinkers hoped to solve was the problem of China's unification. While no early Chinese thinker questioned the need for autocratic rule as an instrument of unification, philosophers differed on whether and how the ruler ought to consider moral limitations on power, traditional religious ceremonies and obligations, and the welfare of his subjects.

Into the philosophical gap created by a lack of political unity and increasing social mobility stepped members of the shi ("retainer" or "knight") class, from which both Confucius and Mencius arose. As feudal lords were defeated and disenfranchised in battle and the kings of the various warring states began to rely on appointed administrators rather than vassals to govern their territories, these shi became lordless anachronisms and fell into genteel poverty and itinerancy. Their knowledge of aristocratic traditions, however, helped them remain valuable to competing kings, who wished to learn how to regain the unity imposed by the Zhou and who sought to emulate the Zhou by patterning court rituals and other institutions after those of the fallen dynasty.

Thus, a new role for shi as itinerant antiquarians emerged. In such roles, shi found themselves in and out of office as the fortunes of various patron states ebbed and flowed. Mencius' office in the state of Qi probably was no more than an honorary title. While out of office, veteran shi might gather small circles of disciples - young men from shi backgrounds who wished to succeed in public life - and seek audiences with rulers who might give them an opportunity to put their ideas into practice. The text of the Mencius claims to record Mencius' teachings to his disciples as well as his dialogues with the philosophers and rulers of his day.

2. The Mencius of the Text

Mencius inherits from Confucius a set of terms and a series of problems. In general, one can say that where Confucius saw a unity of inner and outer - in terms of li (ritual propriety), ren (co-humanity), and the junzi (profound person)-xiaoren (small person) distinction - Mencius tends to privilege the inner aspects of concepts, practices, and identities. For Mencius, the locus of philosophical activity and self-cultivation is the xin (hsin), a term that denotes both the chief organ of the circulatory system and the organ of thought, and hence is translated here and in many other sources as "heart-mind." Mencius' views of the divine, political organization, human nature, and the path toward personal development all start and end in the heart-mind.

Mencius' philosophical concerns, while scattered across the seven books of the text that bears his name, demonstrate a high degree of consistency unusual in early Chinese philosophical writing. They can be categorized into four groups:

  • Theodicy