Category Archives: Philosophers

Leslie Stephen (1832—1904)

stephen-leslieLeslie Stephen was a 19th century British philosopher, man of letters, and first editor of the Dictionary of National Biography. The portion of his writings which bear upon philosophy is small only in relation to his total literary output. He was born in Kensington Gore on November 28, 1832. In 1842 Stephen's parents moved to Brighton for the sake of his health. He attended a day school, but soon entered Eton College. His parents took a house at Windsor so that he could live at home. Stephen made little progress, and was removed by his father in 1846. He was later sent to King's college, and later entered Cambridge's Trinity Hall in 1850. He won a scholarship in mathematics and gained a reputation as an athlete. He was ordained a deacon in 1855, appointed junior tutor in 1856, and ordained a priest in 1859. In 1862 his position at Cambridge changed. His reading in Mill, Comte, and Kant led him to reject the historical evidences of Christianity. He declined to take part in the chapel services. Thereupon at the Master's request, he resigned his tutorship. Hs skepticism steadily grew, and on in 1875 he relinquished his holy orders. When freed from his tutorial and clerical duties, his interests took a wider range, and he subsequently published in the fields of politics, literary criticism, and social criticism. Religious and philosophical speculation engaged much of his attention, and he presented his views in Fraser's Magazine, and Fortnightly Review. A collection of religious and philosophical essays entitled Essays on Free Thinking and Plain Speaking came out in 1873. The book make him a leader of the agnostic school, and a chief challenger of popular religion, which he charged with being unable to satisfy genuine spiritual needs.

He devoted much of his time to his History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century (1876) in which he explained the arguments of the old English deists and the skepticism of Hume. He places the philosophers and moralists in their due position in the whole literary activity of the period. A further stage of the same history ---The English Utilitarians (1900) was completed toward the end of his life. That same year appeared his "An Agnostic's Apology" in the Fortnightly Review; this further revealed his private convictions and helped familiarize the public with the term "agnostic" which had been invented in 1870 by Thomas Huxley, but had not yet become in vogue. In 1878 he joined the Metaphysical Society on the eve of its dissolution, and read two papers at its meetings, In 1882 he produced his Science of Ethics, in which he summed up his final conclusions on the dominant problems of life, in light of his study of Mill, Darwin, and Spencer. He devoted the remainder of his life to other literary projects and died in 1903 of cancer. After his death his monograph on Hobbes appeared (1904).

The first writers who worked out more general consequences of the theory of evolution were scientists with a philosophical turn of mind. Others outside the sciences soon followed in drawing out the consequences of evolution; Stephen was foremost among these, particularly in the area of the ethics. His own independent contribution is given in The Science of Ethics (1882). After Spencer's Data, this is the first book which worked out an ethical view determined by the theory of evolution. He followed Mill and Darwin as an ally of the empirical and utilitarian creed; but he came to see that more extensive changes were necessary. Spencer's compromise between hedonism and evolutionism failed to satisfy him, and he found the ethical bearing of evolution better expressed by the conception of social vitality than by that of pleasure. The great merit of the work consists in its presentation of the social content of morality in the individual mind as well as in the community; but it does not sufficiently recognize the distinction between the historical process traced by the evolution theory and the ethical validity which evolution is assumed to possess.

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Stilpo (c. 380—330 B.C.E.)

StilpoStilpo was a Philosopher of Megara and the most distinguished member of the Megarean school of ancient Greek philosophy. He was not only celebrated for his eloquence and skill in dialectics, but for the success with which he applied to moral precepts of philosophy to the correction of his natural propensities. Though in his youth he had been much addicted to intemperance and licentious pleasures, after he had ranked himself among philosophers he was never known to violate the laws of sobriety or chastity. With respect to riches he exercised a virtuous moderation. When Ptolemy Soter, at the taking of Megara, presented him with a large sum of money, and requested him to accompany him to Egypt, he returned the greater part of the present, and chose to retire, during Ptolemy's stay at Megara, to the island of Aegina. Afterward, when Megara was again taken by Demetrius, son of Antigonus, the conqueror ordered the soldiers to spare the house of Stilpo; and, if anything should be taken from him in the hurry of the plunder, to restore it. So great was the fame of Stilpo, that when he visited Athens, the people ran out of their shops to see him, and even the most eminent philosophers of Athens took pleasure in attending his discourses.

On moral topics Stilpo is said to have taught that the highest happiness consists in a mind free from the dominion of passion, a doctrine similar to that of the Stoics. (Diog. Laert. ii. 113-118; Sen. Epist. 9).

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James Hutchison Stirling (1820—1909)

James Hutchison Stirling was a 19th century British Idealist philosopher. In 1865 Stirling's The Secret of Hegel appeared and marked the inauguration of a new era in the development of English idealism. In an article in the Fortnightly Review for October 1867 (republished in the volume Jerrold, Tennyson, and Macaulay) the author passes a ruthless condemnation upon the spurious reputation for a knowledge of German idealism which had attached itself to the name of Coleridge, as well as, in a minor degree, to that of De Quincey, and fastens especially upon Coleridge's 'dreamy misapprehensions' and 'strange misrepresentations' of the Kantian philosophy. Himself profoundly convinced of the truth of the Hegelian system, he set himself, in the Secret, to explain and defend that system. Stirling undoubtedly possessed 'the temperament of genius,' and was a man of remarkable speculative insight; but his style, though often striking, is so marked by the influence of Carlyle, and he so resolutely declines to conform to ordinary standards of systematic exposition, that his work is almost as difficult as the original which it is intended to illuminate. Yet its importance, and its influence at the time of its appearance, are not to be underestimated; it certainly called the attention of the English-speaking world to the significance of a system which even Ferrier had pronounced unintelligible, and brought home to the English mind the necessity of coming to terms, not only with Hegel, but with his predecessors, Kant, Fichte, and Schelling.Stirling insisted upon going back to the origins of Hegelianism in these earlier systems, and in 1881 he followed up the Secret of Hegel with the Textbook to Kant, in which the defects of the earlier work were less apparent and in which he supported a one-sided interpretation of the Kantian philosophy, as represented by the first two divisions of the Critique of Pure Reason, with great learning and with remarkable ability. His translation of Schwegler's History of Philosophy, published in 1867, which passed through many editions and was used by many generations of students, contains a series of illuminating 'annotations' which rival in interest and value the substance of the History itself. A little volume of lectures on The Philosophy of Law (1873) and the Gifford lectures on Philosophy and Theology (1890) complete the list of Stirling's more important contributions to philosophy. The standpoint is always the same -- that of the Hegelian idealism, which Stirling is inclined to interpret in a theistic rather than in a pantheistic sense.

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Herbert Spencer (1820—1903)

spencerBritish philosopher and sociologist, Herbert Spencer was a major figure in the intellectual life of the Victorian era. He was one of the principal proponents of evolutionary theory in the mid nineteenth century, and his reputation at the time rivaled that of Charles Darwin. Spencer was initially best known for developing and applying evolutionary theory to philosophy, psychology and the study of society -- what he called his "synthetic philosophy" (see his A System of Synthetic Philosophy, 1862-93). Today, however, he is usually remembered in philosophical circles for his political thought, primarily for his defense of natural rights and for criticisms of utilitarian positivism, and his views have been invoked by 'libertarian' thinkers such as Robert Nozick.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Method
  3. Human Nature
  4. Religion
  5. Moral Philosophy
  6. Political Philosophy
  7. Assessment
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Spencer was born in Derby, England on 27 April 1820, the eldest of nine children, but the only one to survive infancy. He was the product of an undisciplined, largely informal education. His father, George, was a school teacher, but an unconventional man, and Spencer's family were Methodist 'Dissenters,' with Quaker sympathies. From an early age, Herbert was strongly influenced by the individualism and the anti-establishment and anti-clerical views of his father, and the Benthamite radical views of his uncle Thomas. Indeed, Spencer's early years showed a good deal of resistance to authority and independence.

A person of eclectic interests, Spencer eventually trained as a civil engineer for railways but, in his early 20s, turned to journalism and political writing. He was initially an advocate of many of the causes of philosophic radicalism and some of his ideas (e.g., the definition of 'good' and 'bad' in terms of their pleasurable or painful consequences, and his adoption of a version of the 'greatest happiness principle') show similarities to utilitarianism.

From 1848 to 1853, Spencer worked as a writer and subeditor for The Economist financial weekly and, as a result, came into contact with a number of political controversialists such as George Henry Lewes, Thomas Carlyle, Lewes' future lover George Eliot (Mary Ann Evans [1819-1880])--with whom Spencer had himself had a lengthy (though purely intellectual) association--and T.H. Huxley (1825-1895). Despite the diversity of opinions to which he was exposed, Spencer's unquestioning confidence in his own views was coupled with a stubbornness and a refusal to read authors with whom he disagreed.

In his early writings, Spencer defended a number of radical causes-- particularly on land nationalization, the extent to which economics should reflect a policy of laissez-faire, and the place and role of women in society--though he came to abandon most of these causes later in his life.

In 1851 Spencer's first book, Social Statics, or the Conditions Essential to Human Happiness appeared. ('Social statics'--the term was borrowed from Auguste Comte--deals with the conditions of social order, and was preliminary to a study of human progress and evolution--i.e., 'social dynamics.') In this work, Spencer presents an account of the development of human freedom and a defense of individual liberties, based on a (Lamarckian-style) evolutionary theory.

Upon the death of his uncle Thomas, in 1853, Spencer received a small inheritance which allowed him to devote himself to writing without depending on regular employment.

In 1855, Spencer published his second book, The Principles of Psychology. As in Social Statics, Spencer saw Bentham and Mill as major targets, though in the present work he focussed on criticisms of the latter's associationism. (Spencer later revised this work, and Mill came to respect some of Spencer's arguments.) The Principles of Psychology was much less successful than Social Statics, however, and about this time Spencer began to experience serious (predominantly mental) health problems that affected him for the rest of his life. This led him to seek privacy, and he increasingly avoided appearing in public. Although he found that, because of his ill health, he could write for only a few hours each day, he embarked upon a lengthy project--the nine-volume A System of Synthetic Philosophy (1862- 93)--which provided a systematic account of his views in biology, sociology, ethics and politics. This 'synthetic philosophy' brought together a wide range of data from the various natural and social sciences and organized it according to the basic principles of his evolutionary theory.

Spencer's Synthetic Philosophy was initially available only through private subscription, but he was also a contributor to the leading intellectual magazines and newspapers of his day. His fame grew with his publications, and he counted among his admirers both radical thinkers and prominent scientists, including John Stuart Mill and the physicist, John Tyndall. In the 1860s and 1870s, for example, the influence of Spencer's evolutionary theory was on a par with that of Charles Darwin.

In 1883 Spencer was elected a corresponding member of philosophical section of the French academy of moral and political sciences. His work was also particularly influential in the United States, where his book, The Study of Sociology, was at the center of a controversy (1879-80) at Yale University between a professor, William Graham Sumner, and the University's president, Noah Porter. Spencer's influence extended into the upper echelons of American society and it has been claimed that, in 1896, "three justices of the Supreme Court were avowed 'Spencerians'." His reputation was at its peak in the 1870s and early 1880s, and he was nominated for the Nobel Prize for Literature in 1902. Spencer, however, declined most of the honors he was given.

Spencer's health significantly deteriorated in the last two decades of his life, and he died in relative seclusion, following a long illness, on December 8, 1903.

Within his lifetime, some one million copies of his books had been sold, his work had been translated into French, German, Spanish, Italian, and Russian, and his ideas were popular in a number of other countries such as Poland (e.g., through the work of the positivist, Wladyslaw Kozlowski). Nevertheless, by the end of his life, his political views were no longer as popular as they had once been, and the dominant currents in liberalism allowed for a more interventionist state.

2. Method

Spencer's method is, broadly speaking, scientific and empirical, and it was influenced significantly by the positivism of Auguste Comte. Because of the empirical character of scientific knowledge and because of his conviction that that which is known--biological life--is in a process of evolution, Spencer held that knowledge is subject to change. Thus, Spencer writes, "In science the important thing is to modify and change one's ideas as science advances." As scientific knowledge was primarily empirical, however, that which was not 'perceivable' and could not be empirically tested could not be known. (This emphasis on the knowable as perceivable led critics to charge that Spencer fails to distinguish perceiving and conceiving.) Nevertheless, Spencer was not a skeptic.

Spencer's method was also synthetic. The purpose of each science or field of investigation was to accumulate data and to derive from these phenomena the basic principles or laws or 'forces' which gave rise to them. To the extent that such principles conformed to the results of inquiries or experiments in the other sciences, one could have explanations that were of a high degree of certainty. Thus, Spencer was at pains to show how the evidence and conclusions of each of the sciences is relevant to, and materially affected by, the conclusions of the others.

3. Human Nature

In the first volume of A System of Synthetic Philosophy, entitled First Principles (1862), Spencer argued that all phenomena could be explained in terms of a lengthy process of evolution in things. This 'principle of continuity' was that homogeneous organisms are unstable, that organisms develop from simple to more complex and heterogeneous forms, and that such evolution constituted a norm of progress. This account of evolution provided a complete and 'predetermined' structure for the kind of variation noted by Darwin--and Darwin's respect for Spencer was significant.

But while Spencer held that progress was a necessity, it was 'necessary' only overall, and there is no teleological element in his account of this process. In fact, it was Spencer, and not Darwin, who coined the phrase "survival of the fittest," though Darwin came to employ the expression in later editions of the Origin of Species. (That this view was both ambiguous --for it was not clear whether one had in mind the 'fittest' individual or species--and far from universal was something that both figures, however, failed to address.)

Spencer's understanding of evolution included the Lamarckian theory of the inheritance of acquired characteristics and emphasized the direct influence of external agencies on the organism's development. He denied (as Darwin had argued) that evolution was based on the characteristics and development of the organism itself and on a simple principle of natural selection.

Spencer held that he had evidence for this evolutionary account from the study of biology (see Principles of Biology, 2 vols. [1864-7]). He argued that there is a gradual specialization in things--beginning with biological organisms--towards self-sufficiency and individuation. Because human nature can be said to improve and change, then, scientific--including moral and political-- views that rested on the assumption of a stable human nature (such as that presupposed by many utilitarians) had to be rejected. 'Human nature' was simply "the aggregate of men's instincts and sentiments" which, over time, would become adapted to social existence. Spencer still recognized the importance of understanding individuals in terms of the 'whole' of which they were 'parts,' but these parts were mutually dependent, not subordinate to the organism as a whole. They had an identity and value on which the whole depended--unlike, Spencer thought, that portrayed by Hobbes.

For Spencer, then, human life was not only on a continuum with, but was also the culmination of, a lengthy process of evolution. Even though he allowed that there was a parallel development of mind and body, without reducing the former to the latter, he was opposed to dualism and his account of mind and of the functioning of the central nervous system and the brain was mechanistic.

Although what characterized the development of organisms was the 'tendency to individuation' (Social Statics [1851], p. 436), this was coupled with a natural inclination in beings to pursue whatever would preserve their lives. When one examines human beings, this natural inclination was reflected in the characteristic of rational self-interest. Indeed, this tendency to pursue one's individual interests is such that, in primitive societies, at least, Spencer believed that a prime motivating factor in human beings coming together was the threat of violence and war.

Paradoxically, perhaps, Spencer held an 'organic' view of society. Starting with the characteristics of individual entities, one could deduce, using laws of nature, what would promote or provide life and human happiness. He believed that social life was an extension of the life of a natural body, and that social 'organisms' reflected the same (Lamarckian) evolutionary principles or laws as biological entities did. The existence of such 'laws,' then, provides a basis for moral science and for determining how individuals ought to act and what would constitute human happiness.

4. Religion

As a result of his view that knowledge about phenomena required empirical demonstration, Spencer held that we cannot know the nature of reality in itself and that there was, therefore, something that was fundamentally "unknowable." (This included the complete knowledge of the nature of space, time, force, motion, and substance.)

Since, Spencer claimed, we cannot know anything non-empirical, we cannot know whether there is a God or what its character might be. Though Spencer was a severe critic of religion and religious doctrine and practice--these being the appropriate objects of empirical investigation and assessment--his general position on religion was agnostic. Theism, he argued, cannot be adopted because there is no means to acquire knowledge of the divine, and there would be no way of testing it. But while we cannot know whether religious beliefs are true, neither can we know that (fundamental) religious beliefs are false.

5. Moral Philosophy

Spencer saw human life on a continuum with, but also as the culmination of, a lengthy process of evolution, and he held that human society reflects the same evolutionary principles as biological organisms do in their development. Society--and social institutions such as the economy--can, he believed, function without external control, just as the digestive system or a lower organism does (though, in arguing this, Spencer failed to see the fundamental differences between 'higher' and 'lower' levels of social organization). For Spencer, all natural and social development reflected 'the universality of law'. Beginning with the 'laws of life', the conditions of social existence, and the recognition of life as a fundamental value, moral science can deduce what kinds of laws promote life and produce happiness. Spencer's ethics and political philosophy, then, depends on a theory of 'natural law,' and it is because of this that, he maintained, evolutionary theory could provide a basis for a comprehensive political and even philosophical theory.

Given the variations in temperament and character among individuals, Spencer recognized that there were differences in what happiness specifically consists in (Social Statics [1851], p. 5). In general, however, 'happiness' is the surplus of pleasure over pain, and 'the good' is what contributes to the life and development of the organism, or--what is much the same--what provides this surplus of pleasure over pain. Happiness, therefore, reflects the complete adaptation of an individual organism to its environment--or, in other words, 'happiness' is that which an individual human being naturally seeks.

For human beings to flourish and develop, Spencer held that there must be as few artificial restrictions as possible, and it is primarily freedom that he, contra Bentham, saw as promoting human happiness. While progress was an inevitable characteristic of evolution, it was something to be achieved only through the free exercise of human faculties (see Social Statics).

Society, however, is (by definition, for Spencer) an aggregate of individuals, and change in society could take place only once the individual members of that society had changed and developed (The Study of Sociology, pp. 366-367). Individuals are, therefore, 'primary,' individual development was 'egoistic,' and associations with others largely instrumental and contractual.

Still, Spencer thought that human beings exhibited a natural sympathy and concern for one another; there is a common character and there are common interests among human beings that they eventually come to recognize as necessary not only for general, but for individual development. (This reflects, to an extent, Spencer's organicism.) Nevertheless, Spencer held that 'altruism' and compassion beyond the family unit were sentiments that came to exist only recently in human beings.

Spencer maintained that there was a natural mechanism--an 'innate moral sense'--in human beings by which they come to arrive at certain moral intuitions and from which laws of conduct might be deduced (The Principles of Ethics, I [1892], p. 26). Thus one might say that Spencer held a kind of 'moral sense theory' (Social Statics, pp. 23, 19).  (Later in his life, Spencer described these 'principles' of moral sense and of sympathy as the 'accumulated effects of instinctual or inherited experiences.') Such a mechanism of moral feeling was, Spencer believed, a manifestation of his general idea of the 'persistence of force.' As this persistence of force was a principle of nature, and could not be created artificially, Spencer held that no state or government could promote moral feeling any more than it could promote the existence of physical force. But while Spencer insisted that freedom was the power to do what one desired, he also held that what one desired and willed was wholly determined by "an infinitude of previous experiences" (The Principles of Psychology, pp. 500-502.) Spencer saw this analysis of ethics as culminating in an 'Absolute Ethics,' the standard for which was the production of pure pleasure--and he held that the application of this standard would produce, so far as possible, the greatest amount of pleasure over pain in the long run.

Spencer's views here were rejected by Mill and Hartley. Their principal objection was that Spencer's account of natural 'desires' was inadequate because it failed to provide any reason why one ought to have the feelings or preferences one did.

There is, however, more to Spencer's ethics than this. As individuals become increasingly aware of their individuality, they also become aware of the individuality of others and, thereby, of the law of equal freedom. This 'first principle' is that 'Every man has freedom to do all that he wills, provided he infringes not the equal freedom of any other man' (Social Statics, p. 103). One's 'moral sense,' then, led to the recognition of the existence of individual rights, and one can identify strains of a rights-based ethic in Spencer's writings.

Spencer's views clearly reflect a fundamentally 'egoist' ethic, but he held that rational egoists would, in the pursuit of their own self interest, not conflict with one another. Still, to care for someone who has no direct relation to oneself--such as supporting the un- and under employed--is, therefore, not only not in one's self interest, but encourages laziness and works against evolution. In this sense, at least, social inequity was explained, if not justified, by evolutionary principles.

6. Political Philosophy

Despite his egoism and individualism, Spencer held that life in community was important. Because the relation of parts to one another was one of mutual dependency, and because of the priority of the individual 'part' to the collective, society could not do or be anything other than the sum of its units. This view is evident, not only in his first significant major contribution to political philosophy, Social Statics, but in his later essays--some of which appear in later editions of The Man versus the State.

As noted earlier, Spencer held an 'organic' view of society, Nevertheless, as also noted above, he argued that the natural growth of an organism required 'liberty'--which enabled him (philosophically) to justify individualism and to defend the existence of individual human rights. Because of his commitment to the 'law of equal freedom' and his view that law and the state would of necessity interfere with it, he insisted on an extensive policy of laissez faire. For Spencer, 'liberty' "is to be measured, not by the nature of the government machinery he lives under [...] but by the relative paucity of the restraints it imposes on him" (The Man versus the State [1940], p. 19); the genuine liberal seeks to repeal those laws that coerce and restrict individuals from doing as they see fit. Spencer followed earlier liberalism, then, in maintaining that law is a restriction of liberty and that the restriction of liberty, in itself, is evil and justified only where it is necessary to the preservation of liberty. The only function of government was to be the policing and protection of individual rights. Spencer maintained that education, religion, the economy, and care for the sick or indigent were not to be undertaken by the state.

Law and public authority have as their general purpose, therefore, the administration of justice (equated with freedom and the protection of rights).  These issues became the focus of Spencer's later work in political philosophy and, particularly, in The Man versus the State. Here, Spencer contrasts early, classical liberalism with the liberalism of the 19th century, arguing that it was the latter, and not the former, that was a "new Toryism"--the enemy of individual progress and liberty.  It is here as well that Spencer develops an argument for the claim that individuals have rights, based on a 'law of life'. (Interestingly, Spencer acknowledges that rights are not inherently moral, but become so only by one's recognition that for them to be binding on others the rights of others must be binding on oneself--this is, in other words, a consequence of the 'law of equal freedom.') He concluded that everyone had basic rights to liberty 'in virtue of their constitutions' as human beings (Social Statics, p. 77), and that such rights were essential to social progress. (These rights included rights to life, liberty, property, free speech, equal rights of women, universal suffrage, and the right 'to ignore the state'--though Spencer reversed himself on some of these rights in his later writings.) Thus, the industrious--those of character, but with no commitment to existing structures except those which promoted such industry (and, therefore, not religion or patriotic institutions)--would thrive. Nevertheless, all industrious individuals, Spencer believed, would end up being in fundamental agreement.

Not surprisingly, then, Spencer maintained that the arguments of the early utilitarians on the justification of law and authority and on the origin of rights were fallacious. He also rejected utilitarianism and its model of distributive justice because he held that it rested on an egalitarianism that ignored desert and, more fundamentally, biological need and efficiency. Spencer further maintained that the utilitarian account of the law and the state was also inconsistent---that it tacitly assumed the existence of claims or rights that have both moral and legal weight independently of the positive law. And, finally, Spencer argues as well against parliamentary, representative government, seeing it as exhibiting a virtual "divine right"---i.e., claiming that "the majority in an assembly has power that has no bounds." Spencer maintained that government action requires not only individual consent, but that the model for political association should be that of a "joint stock company", where the 'directors' can never act for a certain good except on the explicit wishes of its 'shareholders'. When parliaments attempt to do more than protect the rights of their citizens by, for example, 'imposing' a conception of the good--be it only on a minority--Spencer suggested that they are no different from tyrannies.

7. Assessment

Spencer has been frequently accused of inconsistency; one finds variations in his conclusions concerning land nationalization and reform, the rights of children and the extension of suffrage to women, and the role of government. Moreover, in recent studies of Spencer's theory of social justice, there is some debate whether justice is based primarily on desert or on entitlement, whether the 'law of equal freedom' is a moral imperative or a descriptive natural law, and whether the law of equal freedom is grounded on rights, utility, or, ultimately, on 'moral sense'. Nevertheless, Spencer's work has frequently been seen as a model for later 'libertarian' thinkers, such as Robert Nozick, and he continues to be read--and is often invoked--by 'libertarians' on issues concerning the function of government and the fundamental character of individual rights.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • The Proper Sphere of Government, London: W. Brittain, 1843.
  • Social Statics. London: Chapman, 1851.
  • The Principles of Psychology. London: Longmans, 1855; 2nd edn., 2 vols. London: Williams and Norgate, 1870-2; 3rd edn., 2 vols. (1890). [A System of Synthetic Philosophy ; v. 4-5]
  • First Principles. London: Williams and Norgate, 1862; 6th edn., revised, 1904. [A system of Synthetic Philosophy ; v. 1]
  • Principles of Biology, 2 vols. London: Williams and Norgate, 1864, 1867; 2nd edn., 1898-99).[A System of Synthetic Philosophy ; v. 2-3]
  • The Study of Sociology. New York: D. Appleton, 1874, [c1873]
  • The Principles of Sociology.3 vols.  London : Williams and Norgate, 1882-1898. [A System of Synthetic Philosophy, v. 6-8] CONTENTS: Vol. 1: pt. 1. The data of sociology. pt. 2. The inductions of sociology. pt. 3. The domestic relations; Vol. 2: pt. 4. Ceremonial institutions. pt. 5. Political institutions; v. 3: pt. 6. Ecclesiastical institutions. pt. 7. Professional institutions. pt. 8. Industrial institutions.]
  • The Man versus the State:containing "The new Toryism," "The coming slavery," "The sins of legislators," and "The great political superstition," London : Williams & Norgate, 1884; with additional essays and an introduction by Albert Jay Nock. [adds "From freedom to bondage," and "Over- legislation"] Intro. A.J. Nock.  Caldwell, ID: Caxton, 1940.
  • Spencer, Herbert. The Factors of Organic Evolution. London: Williams and Norgate, 1887.
  • Spencer, Herbert. The Principles of Ethics. 2 vols. London: Williams and Northgate, 1892. [A system of synthetic philosophy ; v. 9-10]
  • An Autobiography. 2 v. London: Williams and Norgate, 1904.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Andreski, S. Herbert Spencer: Structure, Function and Evolution. London, 1972.
  • Duncan, David. (ed.) The Life and Letters of Herbert Spencer. London: Methuen, 1908.
  • Gray, T.S. The Political Philosophy of Herbert Spencer, Aldershot: Avebury, 1996.
  • Jones, G. Social Darwinism and English Thought: The Interaction between Biological and Social Theory. Brighton, 1980.
  • Kennedy, James G. Herbert Spencer. Boston: Twayne Publishers, 1978.
  • Miller, David. Social Justice. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1976. Ch. 6
  • Paxton, N.L. George Eliot and Herbert Spencer: Feminism, Evolutionism, and the Reconstruction of Gender. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1991.
  • Peel, J.D.Y. Herbert Spencer: The Evolution of a Sociologist. London, 1971.
  • Ritchie, David G. The Principles of State Interference: Four Essays on the Political Philosophy of Mr Herbert Spencer, J.S. Mill and T.H. Green. London: Swan Sonnenschein, 1891.
  • Taylor, M.W. Men versus the State: Herbert Spencer and late Victorian Liberalism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Wiltshire, David. The Social and Political Thought of Herbert Spencer. New York: Oxford, 1978.

Author Information

William Sweet
St. Francis Xavier University

Al-Shahrastānī (d. 1153 C.E.)

Al-Shahrastānī (d. A.H. 548 / C.E. 1153) was an influential historian of religions and a heresiographer. He was one of the pioneers in developing a scientific approach to the study of religions. Al-Shahrastānī' distinguished himself by his desire to describe in the most objective way the universal religious history of humanity. He was wrongly recognized as an "Ash‘arite" theologian; this is why some scholars such as Muhammad Ridā Jalālī Nā’īnī, Muhammad Taqī Dānish-Pazhūh, Wilferd Madelung, Jean Jolivet, and Guy Monnot firmly believe that he was an Ismā‘īlī who was practicing taqiyya (religious dissimulation) since Ismā‘īlis were persecuted during that time. Very few things are known about al-Shahrastānī's life. He was born in A.H. 479/ C.E. 1086 in the town of Shahristān (Republic of Turkmenistan) where he acquired his early traditional education. Later, he was sent to Nīshāpūr where he studied under different masters who were all disciples of the Ash‘arite theologian al-Juwaynī (d. A.H. 478 / C.E. 1085). At the age of 30, al-Shahrastānī went to Baghdad to pursue theological studies and taught for three years at the prestigious Ash‘arite school, the Nizāmiyya. Afterwards, he returned to Persia where he worked as Nā’ib (Deputy) of the chancellery for Sanjar, the Saljūq ruler of Khurāsān. At the end of his life, al-Shahrastānī went back to live in his native town.

Table of Contents

  1. The Man and His Works
  2. His Intricate Theosophy
  3. References and Further Reading

1. The Man and His Works

During the 'Abbasid Caliphate (A.H. 132/ C.E. 750 - A.H. 656/ C.E. 1258), the golden age of Islamic literature, many schools elaborated their major works of medieval Islamic thought. Shi‘ism has particularly influenced the destiny of Islam in the political and, even more so, the philosophical domain. Isma‘ilism belongs to the Shi‘ite mainstream of Islam. From the beginning, Islam was divided mainly into two groups: the Sunnites and the Shi‘ites. The Sunnites believe that Prophet Muhammad did not explicitly name a Successor after his death. The Shi‘ites affirm, on the contrary, that Muhammad explicitly designated ‘Ali as the first Imam (divine Guide) and his direct descendants as successors. According to Muslim tenets, Muhammad was the last Prophet, the one who closed the Prophetic cycle. The Shi‘ites maintain that humanity still needs a spiritual Guide, therefore the cycle of Prophecy must be succeeded by the cycle of Imama. The prerogative of the Imam is to give the right interpretation of the Qur'an and to gradually reveal its esoteric meaning.

Al-Shahrastani was certainly not an Ash'arite theologian, as has often been argued, even if he borrows some basic concepts shared commonly by various Muslim thinkers. Al-Shahrastani is a difficult person to evaluate because he juggled many different philosophical and theological vocabularies. He was a clever thinker, demonstrated by the intricacies of many traditions and the Shi‘ite notion of the Guide found in his thoughts. Al-Shahrastani had many reasons to speak somewhat allegorically. He was a very subtle author who often spoke indirectly by means of symbols. He preferred his own personal vocabulary to the traditional one. For this reason, his position is hard to determine. It may well be that ideological considerations led him to speak indirectly; he perhaps assumed those familiar with the symbols would be able to unravel his elusive ideas. For all these reasons, many scholars who have studied al-Shahrastani were misled concerning his religious identity. (For an extensive discussion of al-Shahrastānī's identity as Ash‘arite or Ismā‘īlī, cf. Steigerwald, 1997: 298-307.)

The richness and originality of al-Shahrastani's philosophical and theological thought is manifested in his major works. The Kitab al-Milal wa al-Nihal (The Book of Sects and Creeds), a monumental work, presents the doctrinal points of view of all the religions and philosophies which existed up to his time. The Nihayat al-aqdam fi 'ilm al-kalam (The End of Steps in the Science of Theology) presents different theological discussions and shows the limits of Muslim theology (kalam). The Majlis is a discourse, written during the mature period of his life, delivered to a Twelver Shi‘ite audience. The Musara‘at al-Falasifa (The Struggle with Philosophers) criticizes Avicenna’s doctrines by emphasizing some peculiar Isma‘ili arguments on the division of beings. The Mafatih al-Asrar wa-masabih al-abrar (The Keys of the Mysteries and the Lamps of the Righteous) introduces the Qur’an and gives a complete commentary of the first two chapters of the Qur’an.

2. His Intricate Theosophy

As opposed to Ash'arites, al-Shahrastani presents a gradation in the creation (khalq). He gives a definition of the Prophetic Impeccability (‘Isma) opposed to the Ash‘arite tradition, maintaining that it subsists in the Prophet as part of his real nature. As did al-Ghazzali, al-Shahrastani harshly criticizes Avicenna's Necessary Being who knows the universal but not the particular. Al-Shahrastani, particularly in the Musara‘a al-Falasifa, has an Isma‘ili conception of the Originator (Mubdi‘) beyond Being and non-Being. He argues convincingly for the existence of Divine Attributes, but he does not ascribe them directly to God. True worship means Tawhid - declaring the Unicity of God. This includes the negation of all attributes which humans give to God, the Ultimate One who is totally transcendent. God is Unknowable, Indefinable, Unattainable, and above human comprehension.

As for the theory of creation, in the Nihaya, al-Shahrastani insists that God is the only Creator and the only Agent. He also develops a different interpretation of ex-nihilo creation which does not mean creation out of nothing, but creation made only by God. (al-Shahrastani, 1934: 18-9) But in the Majlis and the Mafatih al-Asrar, the angels play a dominant role in the physical creation. (al-Shahrastani, 1998: 82; 1989, vol. I: 109 verso line 24 to 110 recto line 1) His theory of the Divine Word (Kalima) has a convincing Isma'ili imprint; for example, his hierarchy of angels and Divine Words (Kalimat ) are conceived as being the causes of spiritual beings. Al-Shahrastani in the Nihaya writes:

"that his [Divine] Command (Amr) is pre-existent and his multiple Kalimat are eternal. By his Command, Kalimat become the manifestation of it. Spiritual beings are the manifestation of Kalimat and bodies are the manifestation of spiritual beings. The Ibda' (Origination beyond time and space) and khalq (physical creation) become manifested [respectively in] spiritual beings and bodies. As for Kalimat and letters (huruf), they are eternal and pre-existent. Since his Command is not similar to our command, his Kalimat and his letters are not similar to our Kalimat . Since letters are elements of Kalimat which are the causes of spiritual beings who govern corporeal beings; all existence subsists in the Kalimat Allah preserved in his Command." (al-Shahrastani, 1934: 316)

In the Majlis, al-Shahrastani divides the creation into two worlds: the spiritual world (i.e. the world of the Origination of spirits (Ibda'-i arwah)) in an achieved (mafrugh) state) and the world of physical creation (khalq) in becoming (musta'naf). He shares an Isma‘ili cosmology in which God has built his religion in the image of creation.

The conception of Prophecy developed in the Nihaya is closer to that of Isma'ilis and Falasifa (Islamic philosophers) than to Ash‘arites, because al-Shahrastani establishes a logical link between miracles and Prophetic Impeccability (‘Isma). For al-Shahrastani, the proof of veracity (sidq) of the Prophet is intrinsic to his nature and is related to his Impeccability. (Al-Shahrastani, 1934: 444-5) He develops the concept of cyclical time explicitly in the Milal, the Majlis, and the Mafatih and implicitly in the Nihaya. In the Majlis, his understanding of the dynamic evolution of humanity is similar to Isma‘ilism, in which each Prophet opens a new cycle. Al-Shahrastani recovers the mythical Qur'anic story of Moses and the Servant of God inspired by Al-Risala al-Mudhhiba of al-qadi al-Nu‘man (d. A.H. 363 / C.E. 974).

Al-Shahrastani was an able and learned man of great personal charm. The real nature of his thought is best referred to by the term theosophy, in the older sense of "divine wisdom". However, al-Shahrastani was certainly not totally against theology or philosophy, even if he was very harsh against the theologians and the philosophers. As he explained in the Majlis, in order to remain on the right path, one must preserve a perfect equilibrium between intellect ('aql) and audition (sam‘). A philosopher or a theologian must use his intellect until he reaches the rational limit. Beyond this limit, he must listen to the teaching of Prophets and Imams.

His works reflect a complex interweaving of intellectual strands, and his thought is a synthesis of this fruitful historical period. In his conception of God, Creation, Prophecy, and Imama, al Shahrastani adopted many doctrinal elements that are reconcilable with Nizari Isma'ilism. The necessity of a Guide, belonging both to the spiritual and the physical world, is primordial in his scheme since the Imam is manifested in this physical world.

3. References and Further Reading

  • Danish-Pazhuh, Muhammad Taqi
  • 1346HS/1968 "Da'i al-du‘at Taj al-din-i Shahrastana." Nama-yi astan-i quds 7: 77-80
  • 1347HS/1969 "Da'i al-du‘at Taj al-din-i Shahrastana." Nama-yi astan-i quds 8: 61-71.
  • Gimaret, Daniel, Monnot, Guy and Jolivet, Jean
  • 1986-1993 Livre des religions et des sectes. 2 vols. Belgium (Peeters): UNESCO.
  • Jolivet, Jean
  • 2000 "AL-SHAHRASTÂNÎ critique d'Avicenne Dans la Lutte contre les philosophes (quelques aspects)," Arabic Sciences and Philosophy, 10: 275-292.
  • Madelung, Wilferd
  • 1976 "Ash-Shahrastanis Streitschrift gegen Avicenna und ihre Widerlegung durch Nasir ad-din at.-Tusi." Akten des VII. Kongresses für Arabistik und Islamwissenschaft, Abhandlungen der Akademie des Wissenschaften in Göttingen 98: 250-9.
  • Monnot, Guy
  • 1983-84 "Islam: exégèse coranique." Annuaire de l'École Pratique des Hautes Études 92: 305-15.
  • 1986-1987 "Islam: exégèse coranique." Annuaire de l'École Pratique des Hautes Études 95: 253-59.
  • 1987-1988 "Islam: exégèse coranique." Annuaire de l'École Pratique des Hautes Études 96: 237-43.
  • 1996 "Shahrastani." Encyclopédie de l'islam 9: 220-22.
  • 1999 Book review of La pensée philosophique et théologique de Shahrastani (m. 548/1153) by Diane Steigerwald in Bulletin critique des annales islamologiques 15: 79-81.
  • 2001 Book review of Majlis-i maktub-i Shahrastani-i mun'aqid dar Khwarazm. Ed. Muhammad Rida R. Jalali Na'ini and translated into French by Diane Steigerwald in Majlis: Discours sur l’ordre et la création. Sainte-Foy (Québec): Les Presses de l’Université Laval in Bulletin critique des annales islamologiques 17.
  • Na'ini, Jalali
  • 1343HS/1964 Sharh-i Hal wa Athar-i Hujjat al-Haqq Abu al-Fath Muhammad b. 'Abd al-Karim b. Ahmad Shahrastani. Tehran.
  • al-Nu'man, Abu Hanifa
  • 1956 Al-Risala al-Mudhhiba. In Khams Rasa'il Isma'iliyya. Ed. ‘Arif Tamir, Beirut.
  • Al-Shahrastani, Abu al-Fath Ibn 'Abd al-Karim
  • 1850 Kitab al-Milal wa al-Nihal. Trans. Theodor Haarbrücker in Religionspartheien und Philosophen-Schulen. Vol. 1 Halles.
  • 1923 Kitab al-Milal wa al-Nihal. Ed. William Cureton in Books of Religions and Philosophical Sects. 2 vols. Leipzig: Otto Harrassowitz (reprint of the edition of London 1846).
  • 1934 Nihayat al-Aqdam fi 'Ilm al-Kalam. Ed. and partially trans. Alfred Guillaume in The Summa Philosophiae of Shahrastani. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • 1366-1375/1947-1955 Kitab al-Milal wa al-Nihal. Ed. Muhammad Fath Allah Badran, 2 vols. Cairo.
  • 1396/1976 Musara'at al-Falasifa. Ed. Suhayr M. Mukhtar. Cairo.
  • 1989 Mafatih al-Asrar wa-masabih al-abrar. Tehran.
  • 1998 Majlis-i maktub-i Shahrastani-i mun'aqid dar Khwarazm. Ed. Muhammad Rida R. Jalali Na'ini and translated into French by Diane Steigerwald in Majlis: Discours sur l’ordre et la création. Sainte-Foy (Québec): Les Presses de l’Université Laval.
  • 2001 Musara'at al-Falasifa. Ed. and translated by Wilferd Madelung and Toby Mayer in Struggling with the Philosopher: A Refutation of Avicenna's Metaphysics. London: I.B. Tauris.
  • Steigerwald, Diana
  • 1995 "L'Ordre (Amr) et la création (khalq) chez Shahrastani." Folia Orientalia 31: 163-75.
  • 1996 "The Divine Word (Kalima) in Shahrastani's Majlis." Studies in Religion/Sciences religieuses 25.3: 335-52.
  • 1997 La pensée philosophique et théologique de Shahrastani (m. 548/1153). Sainte-Foy (Québec): Les Presses de l'Université Laval.
  • 1998 "La dissimulation (taqiyya) de la foi dans le shi'isme ismaélien." Studies in Religion/Sciences religieusesz, 27.1: 39-59.
  • 2001 Book review of al-Shahrastani, Kitab al-Musâra'at al-Falasifa (Struggling with the Philosopher: A Refutation of Avicenna's Metaphysics), edited and translated by Wilferd Madelung and Toby Mayer, London, Tauris, 2001 in Studies in Religion/Sciences religieuses 30.2: 233-234.
  • 2004 "The Contribution of al-Shahrastani to Islamic Medieval Thought." In Reason and Inspiration: Islamic Studies in Honor of Hermann A. Landolt. London: I.B. Tauris, (forthcoming).

Author Information

Diana Steigerwald
California State University Long Beach
U. S. A.

Gustav Shpet (1879—1937)

Shpet, a professor of philosophy at the University of Moscow, introduced Husserlian transcendental phenomenology into Russia. Additionally, he wrote extensively on aesthetics, hermeneutics, the history of Russian philosophy and the philosophy of language. During the Stalinist years in Russia he was condemned as being an idealist in philosophy and a counter-revolutionary in politics. The depth and breadth of his numerous studies stand as a testament to the philosophic spirit in Russia during the waning years of tsarism.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Gustav Gustavovich Shpet was born in Kiev in April 1879. Late in life during the Stalinist period, he sought to emphasize his humble origins as the illegitimate son of a seamstress. In fact, his maternal grandfather appears to have been a member of the Polish gentry. No information is available on his father. Whether he had any religious upbringing is unclear. On his university registration form he gave his religion as Lutheran, although his mother was, based on family testimony, Catholic.

Upon finishing studies at a gymnasium (secondary school) in Kiev Shpet enrolled at the university there in 1898. Also at this time he became involved in a Marxist circle, although the degree of his active participation is unclear. In any case, his involvement resulted in expulsion from the university. After a relatively short time, however, he was permitted back to attend classes. From that time onward, Shpet always maintained a respectable distance from philosophical Marxism, while apparently retaining a measured sympathy for its socio-economic ideals. After finishing his studies in 1906 he taught for a time at a Kiev gymnasium but followed his former teacher Georgij Chelpanov to Moscow in 1907 upon the latter's succession to the philosophy chair formerly held by Sergej Trubeckoj.

In Moscow Shpet continued his studies at the university and worked in Chelpanov's newly established psychology institute. In addition, he taught at a number of educational institutions in the city. During the summer months of 1910 and 1911 Shpet went abroad to Paris, Edinburgh and various locales in Germany in connection with the psychology institute and his own research for a dissertation. During one of these trips he first encountered Husserl, but it was not until his stay in Goettingen during the 1912-13 academic year that he came firmly under Husserl's influence. Attending Husserl's lectures and seminars at this time, Shpet became acquainted with the nascent ideas of transcendental phenomenology and, in particular, with those that would eventually become known as Ideen II. When Ideen I was published in 1913 Shpet amazingly mastered in short order the change in Husserl's orientation. The next several years were arguably the most philosophically productive of his life, producing in rapid succession a series of works on epistemology, the history of philosophy and the history of Russian philosophy. In 1915 he wrote a large study of the 19th century Moscow philosophy professor Pamfil Yurkevich, followed the next year by the defense and the publication of his dissertation Istorija kak problema logika (History as a Problem of Logic) and then the writing of Germenevtika i ee problemy (Hermeneutics and Its Problems), which languished in manuscript for decades.

His work, however, as the first propagandist, if you will, in Russia for Husserl's transcendental phenomenology and philosophy as a rigorous science is perhaps that for which he is best known, at least in Western philosophical circles. Although the Husserlian influence waned over the years, due at least in part to his increasing isolation within Soviet Russia, Shpet produced within a few short months of its appearance in 1913 the first book-length study of Husserl's Ideen I. In 1917 and 1918 he edited the philosophical yearbook Mysl' i slovo, which also contained valuable contributions by Shpet himself and amplified his own position vis-a-vis Husserlian phenomenology. In 1918 he was appointed to a professorship at Moscow University and in the following year he succeeded to the chair held by Leo Lopatin, who had recently died.

Despite his varied intellectual activities on many fronts during the early years of the Bolshevik regime, Shpet, as an openly non-Marxist intellectual, could not be permitted to retain his teaching position long. His name appeared on Lenin's August 1922 listing of those to be exiled from Russia, a list that included numerous prominent philosophers, such as Berdyaev, Lossky and Lapshin. Shpet, however, successfully appealed to Lunacharskij, the Soviet cultural minister, with whom he was acquainted from his student days in Kiev, to have his name removed.

In 1923 with the creation of the Russian--later State--Academy for Cultural Studies, Shpet was tapped to be its vice-president. There he continued his scholarly work, albeit slightly redirected or, perhaps more accurately, re-focused away from pure philosophy. Again despite his prolific output and that of his colleagues, the Academy, though at least nominally headed by a Marxist, was closed in 1929. Over the next several years he made his living chiefly by preparing translations from such authors as Dickens and Byron, and he also participated in the preparation of a Russian edition of Shakespeare.

On 14 March 1935 Shpet, along with several other former colleagues from the State Academy, was arrested, charged with anti-soviet activities and sentenced to five years internal exile. Later that year the place of exile was changed to Tomsk, a university city in Siberia, where Shpet prepared a new Russian translation of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit. On 27 October 1937 he was again arrested and charged with belonging to a monarchist organization. Recently uncovered documents from the former KGB headquarters in Tomsk indicate that Shpet was executed on 16 November 1937.

2. Philosophy

The nascent secondary literature is still at a very early stage. Nevertheless, already three areas of disagreement exist concerning: a) the influences on Shpet's philosophy; b) the number of stages in the development of his thought; and c) Shpet's lasting contribution to philosophy. With regard to the first area, some have tended to emphasize the phenomenological aspect of his thought and, consequently, have stressed the Husserlian influence. Others have noted the influence of Hegel, while still others have sought to demonstrate Shpet's indebtedness to the Russian metaphysical tradition. To a large degree, however, the depiction of the dominant influence on Shpet has been determined by one's response to the third area, namely, his contribution to philosophy. During the Soviet era, Russian scholars saw Shpet almost exclusively as an historian of Russian philosophy. To the extent that his ideas at that time received recognition in the West he was viewed as the Russian disciple of Husserl. Today both inside Russia and in Western circles Shpet is receiving attention as a phenomenologist of language, if not the first to study language from within a broadly phenomenological perspective.

In any case, Shpet's philosophical development can be broken into at least three periods. Although one contemporary scholar (A. Haardt) holds the first of these to range from 1898-1905, no writings have emerged from these very youthful years and certainly Shpet published nothing at this time. What little information we have comes from an autobiographical remark in his huge 1916 thesis. Thus, seeing his Marxist infatuation as a stage in Shpet's thought serves no useful purpose.

Whatever was the nature of his Marxism, already by 1903 Shpet felt an affinity toward idealism and, in particular, saw the former as riddled with what he thought were epistemological and methodological errors. In his thesis for Kiev University, published under the title "The Problem of Causality in Hume and Kant: Did Kant Answer Hume's Doubt?," Shpet writing under the unmistakable influence of Chelpanov and the "Kiev School of Kant-Interpretation," fundamentally sided with a phenomenalist reading of Kant. In addition, referring explicitly to the writings of the Baden School of neo-Kantianism, Shpet cautiously held that although Kant had demonstrated the "real necessity" of a priori cognitions, he had not proved their "logical necessity."

"We must recognize, therefore, that Kant succeeded in proving the real necessity of a priori categories. Nevertheless, he did not prove their logical necessity. " (1, p. 202)

That is, the Kantian a priori categories, including causality, must be postulated so as to account for objectively valid knowledge. In this way Shpet accords belief in the categories, and thus practical reason, a primacy in and over epistemology. Therefore, based simply on the textual evidence available to the contemporary scholar for analysis, the first period in Shpet's thought is marked by a neo-Kantian phase extending from circa 1903-1912 and is the only period conceptually quite distinct from the others.

The exact evolution of Shpet's ideas immediately after moving to Moscow is unclear. What is clear, however, is that he irrevocably distanced himself from neo-Kantianism and came under the influence of Lopatin and the works of the recently deceased S. Trubeckoj. From them, as well perhaps as through his reading of Vladimir Solovyov, Shpet began to employ the unmistakeable terminology and think philosophically in the categories and problems of Platonism, particularly that variant then dominant at Moscow University. In addition to criticizing psychologism--and, indeed, all "isms"-- for its failure to grasp the psyche as a "living whole," Shpet began to see philosophy itself as based on the immediate data of reflection.

"The spirit of our philosophy is that of a living,concrete and integral philosophy based on the reliable data of inner experience. " (2, p.264.)

Despite the obvious pedigree of this conception in, on the one hand, the Moscow metaphysicians, and, on the other, James, Dilthey, Stumpf and the early Husserl--as Shpet himself acknowledged--we should not disregard the fact that Chelpanov also stressed the importance of introspection as a technique in psychology, albeit bereft of metaphysical interpretation.

The next period in Shpet's philosophy is that for which he is best known. In Appearance and Sense, published in mid-1914, Shpet provided, on the one hand, a summarization of many points covered in Husserl's Ideen I. Yet, on the other hand, Shpet sought to invoke Husserl's transcendental turn for his own purposes, while cautiously noting what he saw as deficiencies in the latter. Like Husserl, Shpet was willing to characterize phenomenology as the fundamental science and, again like Husserl, Shpet made extensive use of eidetic intuition. This reliance on the Husserlian technique of "ideation" is one that Shpet continued to value years later even after coming under political attack for his idealism. Husserl and Shpet differed, however, on the goal of such procedures and methods. Whereas the former sought to construct a presuppositionless philosophy, a "science" of consciousness and cognition, Shpet saw philosophy as ultimately a study of being, of which cognizing is but one form among many. Modern philosophy's error is found in its concentration on the forms of cognition, rather than on cognition as such. In modern parlance we could say philosophy has failed to distinguish the forest from the trees. The subject-matter of phenomenology, as Shpet conceived it, is the study of cognition, qua a mode of being. The major oversight of modern philosophy is not to have seen the non-empirical and non-actual nature of the cognizing subject.

Of the several articles Shpet published immediately subsequent to the appearance of Appearance and Sense two in particular stand out: "Consciousness and Its Proprietor" and "Wisdom or Reason." In the first of these, which appeared in 1916, Shpet already addressed an issue that would later prove to be a major bone of contention among the next generation of phenomenologists. Developing ideas enunciated by Solovyov during the last years of his life, Shpet asked who "owns" or "possesses" the unity of consciousness. Whereas he is willing, pace Hume, to concede on the issue of such a unity, it is no one's, i.e., it has no proprietor. We are led astray in seeking such a proprietor by an inaccurate analogy drawn from our everyday language.

"Ultimately, it is as impossible to say whose consciousness as it is to say whose space, whose air, even though everybody is convinced that the air which he breathes is his air, and the space which he occupies is his space. " (4, p. 205)

In direct opposition to Husserl, whom he accuses of betraying the "principle of all principles," stated in Ideen I, Shpet finds no "pure Ego." What unity there is certainly cannot serve as an epistemological guarantee, and it certainly cannot be called a Self or an Ego.

In "Wisdom or Reason" from 1917 Shpet presents what may well be the first attempt to depict the phenomenological idea, or what we today often view as that idea, as the telos of Western philosophy. Noticeably, however, Shpet never mentions phenomenology as such; instead he uses the locution "philosophy as pure knowledge" and even "philosophy as knowledge." In a precise manner, Parmenides established the proper object of philosophy and showed the path along which philosophy is directed to solve the problem posed by that object. (5, p. 7)

This itself can be seen as a distancing from the Husserlian influence in that Shpet traces his conception back to the Greeks and indeed to Parmenides. In any case, Shpet holds that philosophy proceeds through three stages (and as in Hegel's Phenomenology whether these are purely logical or chronological as well is arguable): from wisdom then on to metaphysics before finally arriving at rigorous science or knowledge. Unlike positivistic "scientific philosophy," which seeks to copy the methodology of an arbitrarily chosen natural science or bases itself on results attained in natural science, philosophy as pure knowledge grounds the specific sciences.

The recent emergence and publication of Shpet's hitherto virtually inaccessible 1918 work Hermeneutics and Its Problems, in both the original Russian and a German translation, has drawn notable international attention. In it Shpet presents a history of hermeneutics ranging from the Greeks to the early 20th century, seeing the work of Dilthey and Husserl, as represented in the first "Logical Investigation," as the highest point yet attained.

Throughout this period and later Shpet maintained that his work was a continuation of that direction in philosophy associated with Brentano and Husserl. Where they erred was in forgetting the social dimension. There can and do exist forms of collective or socio-cultural consciousness. An element of such consciousness is language, more specifically words. The understanding plays an analogous role in the grasping of sense, for which words act as the "material bearer," as sense perception does in the individual's representational consciousness. Shpet developed these themes at some length in his Aesthetic Fragments from 1922/23 and his Inner Form of the Word from 1927.

In addition, Shpet shortly before and after the Bolshevik Revolution devoted considerable attention to the history of Russian philosophy, publishing a number of valuable studies studded with numerous caustic comments on the poverty of philosophy in his homeland.

3. References and Further Reading

  • "Problema prichinosti u Juma i Kanta. Otvetil li Kant na somnenija Juma?" ("The Problem of Causality in Hume and Kant. Did Kant Answer Hume's Doubt?"), Kievskie universitetskie izvestija, 1907, #5.
  • "Odin put' psikhologii i kuda on vedet" ("One Path in Psychology and Where It Leads"), Filosofskij sbornik L. M. Lopatinu ot Moskovskogo Psikhologicheskogo Obshchestva, Moscow, 1912, pp. 245-264.
  • Javlenie i smysl, Moscow, 1914. [English translation: Appearance and Sense, trans. by Thomas Nemeth, Kluwer Academic Publishers: Dordrecht, 1991]
  • "Soznanie i ego sobstvennik" ("Consciousness and Its Proprietor"), Sbornik statej po filosofii, posvjashchennyj G. I. Chelpanovu, Moscow, 1916, pp. 156-210.
  • Istorija kak problema logiki. Kriticheskie i metodologicheskie issledovanija. Chast' I: Materialy (History as a Problem of Logic. Critical and Methodological Investigations. Part I: Materials), Moscow, 1916.
  • "Mudrost' ili razum" ("Wisdom or Reason"), Mysl' i slovo, vyp. 1, 1917, pp. 1-69.
  • Ocherk razvitija russkoj filosofii. Chast 1. (An Outline of the Development of Russian Philosophy. Part 1.), Petrograd, 1922.
  • Esteticheskie fragmenty (Aesthetic Fragments), I. Petergrad 1922. II, III. Petrograd 1923.
  • Vnutrennjaja forma slova. Etjudy i variacii na temy Humbol'dta (Inner Form of the Word. Studies and Variations on a Humboldtian Theme), Moscow, 1927.

Author Information

Thomas Nemeth
U. S. A.

Abu Ya'qub al-Sijistani (fl. 971)

Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani was first and foremost a member of the Ismaili underground mission — the da‘wa, as it is known in Arabic — that operated in the Iranian province of Khurasan and Sijistan during the tenth century. In the later part of his life, al-Sijistani was or had become a supporter of the Fatimids imams, then ruling from their headquarters far away in North Africa.Al-Sijistani was deeply inspired by Neoplanotism. His cosmology and metaphysics develop a concept of God as the one beyond both being and non-being. God is not a substance, not intellect, nor within the categories that pertain to the created universe in any way. Intellect is the first existent being, originated by God as an indivisible whole.

In contrast to many other Islamic philosophers, al-Sijistani insists that intellect does not divide or separate. The intellect remains a whole and is universal. Only one intellect engenders by procession the soul. The soul falls therefore on its higher side within the lower horizon of intellect whereas its own lower aspect is nature, a semi-hypostatic being between the spiritual and the physical realm. The goal of religion and prophecy is to reorient the soul toward its true higher self and ultimately to return to its original state.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Neoplatonism
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani was first and foremost a member of the Ismaili underground mission — the da‘wa, as it is known in Arabic — that operated in the Iranian province of Khurasan and Sijistan during the tenth century. His activities and the works he wrote must be seen in that context; he was a partisan of a specific religious and political cause that involved the restoration of Shi‘ism as the dominant force in the Islamic world of the time. In addition al-Sijistani was an important advocate of philosophical doctrines that drew heavily on a current of Neoplatonism then circulating in intellectual circles of various kinds in the major centers of Islamic scholarship. For the latter reason in general and for his clear attachment in his philosophical writings to a fairly pure form of this branch of ancient thought, he earned an important place in the history of philosophy, even though he himself would have insisted that he was not a philosopher.

Although he is mentioned both in Ismaili and non-Ismaili sources, the amount of information about his life that survives is scarcely adequate. Two important details emerge from one of his late works: he was in Baghdad in the year 934 having just then returned from the pilgrimage to Mecca, and in about 971 or 972 he composed that treatise itself. Somewhat later he died a martyr. The one additional fact about him is a nickname, 'Cotton-seed,' recorded by several observers both in its Arabic and its Persian forms. By the time he wrote (or revised) those works of his that are now extant, al-Sijistani was or had become a supporter of the Fatimids imams, then ruling from their headquarters far away in North Africa. Hints in his own works and other information suggests, however, that he may have earlier belonged to a dissident wing of the Ismaili movement, as was the case with at least two of his philosophical predecessors in Iran. Accordingly, the works he wrote prior to his acceptance of the Fatimids as imams, would have been considered doctrinally false and they, unless revised, were abandoned and thus did not survive.

2. Neoplatonism

Those now available are certainly not all complete and one exists solely in a later Persian paraphrase of its original (lost) Arabic. Critical editions and translations are few in number. Moreover, the philosophical content in some works far exceeds that of others. It was al-Sijistani's custom to assemble his material in a series of, often disconnected, topical chapters and to mix Ismaili doctrinal teachings with philosophy in alternating, but most often not overlapping, short sections. Therefore, his Neoplatonism frequently appears in what he wrote separated — although not always — from his more specifically religious concerns. Thus his philosophical position becomes apparent only in portions of his works, in particular certain chapters of his The Wellsprings, The Keys, Prophecy’s Proof, and Revealing the Concealed. On these titles, their general contents, and the state of modern studies of them, see Paul E. Walker, Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani: Intellectual Missionary (London, 1998) especially the appendix.

The Neoplatonic background to al-Sijistani's thought is fairly complex. Beginning as early as the middle of the preceding century several important texts, or portions of them, were translated from Greek into Arabic, including the widely circulated Theologia, sometimes called the Theology of Aristotle. Others were a longer version of this same Theologia, the Liber de causis, and a doxographical work that goes by the name of the Pseudo-Ammonius. The Theologia contains for the most part passages from Plotinus’s Enneads IV to VI; the Liber de causis depends ultimately on Proclus’s Element of Theology. All of these texts and others were available to the Ismaili philosophers —and other Islamic thinkers — by the beginning of the tenth century. The Islamic world had time by then to digest this material thoroughly and to begin an elaboration of various specific doctrines expressed in it. From his position a generation or so later, al-Sijistani came to Neoplatonism as much from within a nascent Islamic tradition of it as of his own raw confrontation with specific individual Greek (or pseudo-Greek) texts, which his own writings reflect therefore only secondarily.

Nevertheless, the major Neoplatonic influences in the thought of al-Sijistani comprise a cosmology and metaphysics that adhere closely to important doctrines of Plotinus, among them an austerely rigorous concept of God as the one beyond both being and non-being. God is not a substance, not intellect, nor within the categories that pertain to the created universe in any way. Intellect is the first existent being, originated by God as an indivisible whole. It is the source of all else that exists. In contrast to many other Islamic philosophers, al-Sijistani adamantly insists that intellect does not divide or separate. There is only one intellect. It does, however, engender by procession the soul and the latter again remains a whole and is a universal. It does, even so, descend in parts into individual creatures who are thus animated by it. The soul falls therefore on its higher side within the lower horizon of intellect whereas its own lower aspect is nature, a semi-hypostatic being at the point of transition from the spiritual into the physical realm. The goal of religion and of prophecy is to reorient the soul toward its true unblemished higher self and ultimately to have it regain its original sublime existence.

Although the outline of standard Neoplatonic ideas can be observed in al-Sijistani's thought, there are curiosities that do not seem to belong. One is his doctrine that God creates by willful fiat — that is, by issuing a command to be. Another involves the notion that salvation — the restoration in the soul of its spirituality — is a historical development that runs upward step by step following the course of the cycles of prophetic revelations and the religious laws that each lawgiving-prophet establishes in turn.

3. References and Further Reading

  • H. Corbin, Trilogie ismaélienne (Tehran and Paris, 1961)
  • H. Corbin, ed., Kashf al-mahjub (Revealing the Concealed) (Tehran and Paris, 1949), French trans. Corbin, Le dévoilement des choses caches (Paris, 1988).
  • P. Walker, Early Philosophical Shiism: The Ismaili Neoplatonism of Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani (Cambridge, 1993).
  • P. Walker, The Wellsprings of Wisdom: A study of Abu Ya‘qub al-Sijistani's Kitab al-yanabi‘ (Salt Lake City, 1994).

Author Information

Paul E. Walker
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Johann Christian Friedrich Hölderlin (1770—1843)

HolderlinAlthough J. C. F. Hölderlin has, since the beginning of the twentieth century, enjoyed the reputation of being one of Germany’s greatest poets, his recognition as an important philosophical figure is more recent. The revival of an interest in German Idealism, and the philosophical developments from Kant’s critical period to Hegel’s mature thought, have ensured that Hölderlin is given his due for his important philosophical insights. Hölderlin’s life was marked by theological training, together with Hegel and Schelling, followed by a period of simultaneous philosophical and poetic activity. Eventually, Hölderlin concentrated on poetry as a superior form of access to the truth. His theoretical philosophy is marked by an anti-foundationalist rebuttal of Fichte’s first principle. The key idea is that nothing can be said about what grounds the possibility of the subject-object relation, a primordial unity which Hölderlin calls Absolute Being. This central idea was crucial to the development of Schelling’s thought. Hölderlin’s ethical views emphasize an understanding of life as torn between two principles: a hankering after this original unity and freedom’s desire to constantly assert itself. His novel Hyperion illustrates this struggle and how the integration of these two principles is set as a goal for life. The superiority of poetry over philosophy in pointing to the truth is suggested through this novel plus several poems, and this theme was of particular interest for Heidegger’s later thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Overview
  2. Life and Philosophical Background
  3. Unity and Freedom
  4. The Self and Human Life
  5. Hölderlin’s Influence
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Overview

Johann Christian Friedrich Hölderlin is well known as a key figure of German romantic poetry. This recognition was, however, late to come, and it is chiefly in the first half of the twentieth century that he acquires his status as one of Germany’s greatest poets, and, in particular, became a key figure in Heidegger’s later thought. Hölderlin’s own contribution to philosophy, both in theoretical and literary form, has taken much longer to be acknowledged. It is of great importance, however, both for an understanding of the development of German Idealism and in relation to contemporary philosophical issues. Although Hölderlin left little published material of direct philosophical relevance, his personal acquaintance with Schiller, Novalis, Fichte, Schelling and Hegel ensured the dissemination of his ideas among his immediate contemporaries. In the second half of the twentieth century, two factors have been decisive in the renewed interest in Hölderlin as a philosopher. On the one hand, there has been a striking growth of scholarship in the philosophy that marks the transition from Kant to Hegel, chiefly through philosophers such as Dieter Henrich and Manfred Frank. On the other, a short philosophical text came to light in 1961, which for the first time presented key central tenets of Hölderlin’s thought in a concise form.

2. Life and Philosophical Background

Hölderlin was born in 1770 in Swabia in South-Western Germany. He studied theology and was originally destined for a career in the Lutheran church. His studies eventually took him, at the age of eighteen, to the famous Tübingen seminary where he studied with Hegel, as well as with his old school friend Schelling. Hölderlin came to Jena in 1794, after Fichte had taken over the chair of philosophy from Reinhold. During that period, Hölderlin was a staunch supporter of the French Revolution, which was seen by many German intellectuals as a source of hope for the future. Hölderlin found a position as a private tutor and fell passionately in love with his pupils’ mother, Susette Gontard. She was to be the inspiration behind the Diotima of his novel Hyperion. The emotional upheaval caused by the end of the impossible liaison with Susette had a detrimental effect on his health. In 1800, after his disillusionment with philosophy that led him to abandon any plans to find an academic position, he spent a year recovering in Switzerland and decided to devote the rest of his life to writing poetry. In 1802, the news of Susette’s death, however, drove him to near insanity. Treatment enabled him to continue writing at intervals while working as a librarian in Homburg until 1807 when he became insane (though harmless). In 1805, he was one of a group of Jacobin militants, led by his friend Isaac von Sinclair, involved in a conspiracy against the Elector of Württemberg. Hölderlin was accused of high treason, but thereafter was released on grounds of diminished mental capacity. He was taken to Tübingen where he lived until his death in 1843. Some form of poetic output continued in Tübingen, although these later poems are significantly marked by Hölderlin’s mental illness.

Hölderlin’s original philosophical thought emerged before his move to Jena: the main poetic work of philosophical interest, Hyperion, was started in Tübingen in 1792, and after the publication of a fragment in Schiller’s review Thalia, the full work was later published in two volumes in Jena. It is, however, in Jena that Hölderlin’s philosophical ideas took their definitive form, partly as a result of its bustling intellectual climate.

The philosophical background to his philosophical ideas can be traced back to Reinhold’s lectures and publications on Kant’s philosophy in the late 1780’s and early 1790’s. Reinhold, who was one of the main expositors of Kantian critical thought of that period, developed a philosophical system essentially aimed at providing Kant’s critical philosophy with a first principle. The need to underpin Kant’s system with such a ground was to prove a fundamental, but contentious, issue for the philosophical developments of the 1790’s in Germany.

Fichte echoed some of the criticisms that were to be addressed in the specifics of Reinhold’s first principle, the principle of consciousness (e.g. in Schulze’s Aenesidemus, see Giovanni and Harris, 2000), but agreed with the need for such a grounding and set out to provide his own first principle instead. The resulting system, the Wissenschaftslehre (Doctrine of science), first published in 1794, was Fichte’s attempt to develop a philosophical doctrine that would respect the spirit, if not the letter, of Kant’s critical philosophy. The first principle of this philosophy expressed a relation of the I to itself: “The I posits its own being unconditionally” (Fichte, 1994). Against any such grounding attempts, the circle of Jena philosophers around Niethammer claimed, in line with earlier criticism of Kant by Jacobi, that such an enterprise was flawed in principle; since any principle requires justification beyond itself, an infinite regress ensues. As a result, philosophy, for Niethammer’s circle, is an unending enterprise that approaches the truth but can never reach it.

This anti-foundationalist line became Hölderlin’s when he rejected Fichte’s philosophy in the mid-1790s, but the philosophical ideas that Hölderlin developed during this period were also motivated by other concerns. To understand these, we must turn to moral philosophy. Kant’s ethics had a profound influence on many writers of the time, and Schiller’s response is particularly important. In 1793, Schiller showed enthusiasm for Kant’s ethics of duty while querying the rigorism which some Kantian statements strongly suggest. Hence, Schiller’s famous joke that it seems Kant prefers the agent who would do his duty with displeasure, to one whose inclinations are in line with the commands of the moral law. Schiller claimed that a harmony of duty and inclination represented the highest ideal of morality, while Kant found inclinations to be worthless. In his letters, “On the Aesthetic Education of Man” (Schiller, 1982), he argues for the moral value of the aesthetic ideal of grace (Anmut). For Schiller, “grace” describes the moral beauty of an agent whose emotions have been educated by reason. Given Schiller’s endorsement of the basic tenets of Kant’s ethics, this notion of the “beautiful soul” is problematic. Indeed, it implies a purported reconciliation between the sublimity that attaches to the dutiful agent who, in his freedom, places the moral law above all inclinations, and the beauty of a harmony of inclinations and duty. Since the moral law, however, requires that the agent act out of duty regardless of what inclines her, this is hardly compatible with an ideal of harmony between duty and inclinations. As a result of the tension between the freedom of the moral agent and this ideal of harmony, the cogency of the proposed moral value of the beautiful soul becomes questionable.

3. Unity and Freedom

Hölderlin, in fact, sees these two aspects of human life, the “all-desiring, all-subjugating dangerous side of man,” i.e. freedom, and the “most beautiful condition he can achieve,” i.e. unity (preface to Hyperion in Thalia, 1794) as representing the essence of the human condition. This accounts for his understanding of human life as man’s “eccentric path”: an unreflective unity constitutes the core of our existence, but we cannot remain within it. Rather, it becomes something we strive towards with our freedom.

With this bi-polarity in mind, we can now appreciate Hölderlin’s contribution to the theoretical debate around Fichte’s attempts to find a foundational principle for philosophy. Fichte had proposed to ground philosophy on the pure relation of the I to itself. In Über Urtheil und Seyn (On Judgment and Being), a short manuscript that was only first published in 1961 (Hölderlin, 1972), Hölderlin points out that subjectivity cannot provide the first principle of philosophy since the I is always defined in relation to an object of judgment. This criticism of Fichte’s system may appear unfair as, in the 1797 edition of the Doctrine of Knowledge, he does discuss the fact that there must be a pre-reflective form of self-awareness. However, Fichte does not draw all the consequences from this observation. Hölderlin’s point is that such self-consciousness cannot be accounted for in terms of the I of judgment. The ground for the I’s reflective self-consciousness must, thus, be sought beyond the division between the subject ‘I’ and an object which this presupposes. Such a ground, Hölderlin calls “absolute Being. This is, moreover, the ground for all judgments in which the subject ‘I’ is distinguished from an object.

An original unity of subject and object in Being is what underpins their separation in judgment. Hölderlin, thus, defines Being as follows: “Where Subject and Object are absolutely, not just partially united…there and not otherwise can we talk of an absolute Being, as is the case in intellectual intuition (ibid., p. 515).” He understands judgment as the original cleavage of object from subject: “Judgment: is in the highest and strictest sense the original sundering of Subject and Object most intimately united in intellectual intuition, the very sundering which first makes Object and Subject possible (ibid., p.516).” Of Being, no further knowledge is possible. It is only known as the original unity that underpins all judgments. It, therefore, functions as a postulated ground rather than as a first principle.

4. The Self and Human Life

In terms of the understanding of the self, there are two types of self-awareness. In one sense, when I reflect upon myself, I am distinct from the object of my awareness. In another, I must understand myself as belonging to an original pre-reflective unity. The first provides the ground for the freedom of the I to raise itself above anything that is given in the empirical world. The second provides the self with an ideal of unity characterised by a belonging to Being. The “eccentric path” of life is, therefore, torn between these two poles of unity and freedom. The latter takes us away from the original unity while being grounded in it. The task of integrating the two poles in one’s life is that of bringing freedom to recognize the greater unity of Being, but this can only be a progressive and never-ending enterprise.

The novel Hyperion presents different practical approaches to dealing with the bi-polarity of the “eccentric path.” This novel is a collection of letters, mostly written by the novel’s modern Greek hero, Hyperion, to his German friend, Bellarmin, in which he recounts his adventures, states of mind, and longings. The original unity which Hyperion was, from the outset, keen to recapture, is understood in different ways by Hyperion at different stages of his life. Ultimately, he will realize that none of these is satisfactory, but that they represented ways of approaching that which is the underlying unity, i.e. Being, throughout the course of his life.

These different representations of unity are of ancient Greece (also reflected in childhood), of modern Greece liberated from Turkish rule, and of aesthetic beauty. This trilogy is not random but corresponds to different temporal understandings of the idea of the fundamental unity of Being. It is first grasped as belonging to the past (Childhood/Ancient Greece), then the future (liberated Greece), and finally the present (immediacy of aesthetic beauty). Each way of life is exemplified by a character with whom Hyperion is connected, respectively through a master-pupil relationship (Adamas), friendship (Alabanda) and love (Diotima).

In each case, Hyperion attempts to fully adopt the corresponding way of being only to find its limitations and be confronted with the need to move on. Thus, with Adamas, Hyperion feels compelled to leave his master and seek another way of life because of man’s lack of contentment and constant desire to go beyond his current condition: “We delight in flinging ourselves into the night of the unknown, into the cold strangeness of any other world, and, if we could, we would leave the realm of the sun and rush headlong beyond the comet’s track” (Hölderlin, 1990, p. 10) [“Wir haben unsre Lust daran, uns in die Nacht des Unbekannten, in die kalte Fremde irgend einer andern Welt zu stürzen, und wär’ es möglich, wir verlieβen der Sonne Gebiet und stürmten über des Irrsterns Grenzen hinaus” (Hölderlin, 1999, p.492)]. After leaving home and learning about the world, his encounter with Alabanda is that of a soul-mate who has fought his way to freedom. Together, they plan noble and heroic deeds, but Hyperion’s world crumbles when he realizes the dark side of such purported moral ambition. Alabanda’s friends are ruthless revolutionaries who seek to overthrow the present powers by violent means: “The cold sword is forged from hot metal” (ibid., p.26) [“Aus heiβem Metalle wird das kalte Schwert geschmieden” (ibid., p. 510)]. Through this experience, Hyperion grasps something of the conflictual nature of human life: “If the life of the world consists in an alteration between opening and closing, between going forth and returning, why is it not even so with the heart of man” (ibid., p.29) [“Bestehet ja das Leben der Welt im Wechsel des Entfaltens und Vershlieβens, in Ausflug und in Rückkehr zu sich selbst, warum nicht auch das Herz des Menschen” (ibid., p.514)]? However, it is by encountering beauty in the person and life of Diotima (Book II of Volume I) that Hyperion believes he has found what he is looking for, i.e. the Unity he is after: “I have seen it once, the one thing that my soul sought, and the perfection that we put somewhere far away above the stars, that we put off until the end of time – I have felt it in its living presence” (ibid., p.41) [“Ich habe es Einmal gesehen, das Einzige, das meine Seele suchte, und die Vollendung die wir über die Sterne hinauf entfernen, die wir hinausscheben bis ans Ende der Zeit, die hab’ ich gegenwärtig gefühlt” (ibid., p.529)]. A period of bliss ensues, but Diotima understands that Hyperion is “born for higher things” (ibid., p.72) [“zu höhern Dingen geboren” (ibid., p.566)], that the simple harmony of her life is not for him. He must go out and bring beauty to those places where it is lacking. Having grasped this (Book I of Volume II), Hyperion answers Alabanda’s call to join him in battle to free Greece.

Hyperion’s departure for battle is followed by several letters addressed to Diotima and a couple of her replies. After initial success in the fight against the Turks, Hyperion’s men are delayed by the long siege of Mistra. Nonetheless, as they finally enter the town, they go on a]rampage, pillaging and killing indiscriminately. Rather than face the enemy, Hyperion’s army disperses once its lust for plunder is satisfied. This leads to the death of forty Russian soldiers who stood alone fighting the common foe. Hyperion takes his army’s dishonour to make him unworthy, in his eyes, for Diotima’s love: “I must advise you to give me up, my Diotima” (ibid., p.98) [“ich muβ dir raten, daβ du mich verlässest, meine Diotima” (ibid., p.597)]. In letters to Bellarmin, we discover more details of the battles fought by Hyperion and Alabanda. Their friendship flourished again, but Alabanda’s lust for battle eventually came to an end, thus pointing once more to the limits of his way of life. In a letter from Diotima that arrives later, it emerges that she lost her will to live as her lover did not return, and she finally let herself die. In a development which reflects Hölderlin’s understanding of human life, the effortless harmony of Diotima’s world of beauty, once disturbed by the fire of Hyperion’s free aspiration to noble deeds, could not simply return to its original form. Rather, it became something to aim for, something Diotima thought Hyperion could achieve for her: “You drew my life away from the Earth, but you would also have had power to bind me to the Earth” (ibid., p.122) [“Du entzogst main Leben der Erde, du hättest auch Macht gehabt, mich an die Erde zu fesseln” (ibid., p.626)]. It is, thus, through its very destruction, that Diotima’s way of life ceases to represent that which Hyperion could have sought to take refuge in. Diotima’s words illustrate the whole problem of life as an “eccentric path,” but her death, apparently, only leaves Hyperion confused: “as I am now, I have no names for things and all before me is uncertainty” (ibid., p.126) [“wie ich jetzt bin, hab ich keinen Namen für die Dinge, und es ist mir alles ungewiβ” (ibid., p.632)]. At the end of the novel, however, the beauty of Nature once again fills Hyperion with joy, and this poetic sense of oneness reaches beyond separation and death to Alabanda and Diotima. Somehow, he has made some sense of his experiences. Thus, after all these tragedies, an overall feeling of unity prevails: “You springs of earth! you flowers! and you woods and you eagles and you brotherly light! how old and new is our love!- We are free, we are not narrowly alike in outward semblance; how should the Mode of life not vary? yet we love the ether, all of us, and in the inmost of our inmost selves we are alike” (ibid., p.133) [“Ihr Quellen der Erd! Ihr Blumen! Und ihr Wälder und ihr Adler und du brüderliches Licht! Wie alt und neu ist unsere Liebe! – Frei sind wir, gleichen uns nicht ängstig von auβen; wie sollte nicht wechseln die Weise des Lebens? Wir lieben den Äther doch all und innigst im Innersten gleichen wir uns” (ibid., p.639-640)]. However, the last words of the novel suggest an open ending: “So I thought. More soon” (ibid., p.133) [“So dacht’ ich. Nächstens mehr” (ibid., p.640)]. Thus, after all the ordeals that he has worked through in these letters, Hyperion’s life goes on. This seems to point to new experiences and the possibility of revisiting his interpretation of his life thus far.

The poetic contemplation of our oneness with Nature, which is prominent in the novel’s final letter, points to an understanding which philosophy cannot reach. Hyperion hints at this when he complains about the Germans: “Is not the air that you drink in better than your chatter? Are not the sun’s rays nobler than all of you in your cleverness” (ibid., p.129) [“Ist besser, denn euer Geschwätz, die Luft nicht, die ihr trinkt? Der Sonne Strahlen, sind sie edler nicht, denn all’ ihr Klugen” (ibid., p.635)]? Hölderlin’s life confirms his endorsement of the superiority of poetry. After the Jena period, he finally followed the advice his friend Schiller had given him in 1796 and never returned to philosophical argumentation, rather seeking to show something of the greater unity of Being in poetic form.

In line with his understanding of Being as lying beyond our ken, Hölderlin developed a theory of tonal modulations (Wechseltonlehre) that is illustrated in much of his poetic output. According to this theory, there are three fundamental poetic tones: the naïve, the heroic and the ideal. A tone, however, cannot be expressed in its pure form but only through a tension with its medium, a tension created by the work of art. Thus, the poem becomes what Hölderlin calls an “extended metaphor” of what cannot be said directly (Hölderlin, 1990).

5. Hölderlin’s Influence

Because of his small philosophical output, it is important to indicate in what way Hölderlin’s ideas have influenced his contemporaries and later thinkers. It was Hölderlin whose ideas showed Hegel that he could not continue to work on the applications of philosophy to politics without first addressing certain theoretical issues. In 1801, this led Hegel to move to Jena where he was to write the Phenomenology of Spirit. It could be argued, however, that Hegel’s (1977) view of poetry as belonging to the past and his dismissal of the Romantic movement, show a lack of a grasp of the kind of point Hölderlin was making.

Schelling’s early work amounts to a development of Hölderlin’s concept of Being in terms of a notion of a prior identity of thought and object in his Philosophy of Identity (Schelling, 1994). This philosophy apparently makes knowledge of the Absolute (i.e. the absolute ground) impossible, and Schelling wrestles with the possibility of articulating how the Absolute amounts to knowledge of itself in Hegelian fashion. However, his later philosophy clearly distinguishes itself from Hegel’s in that it claims that the ground of the understanding contained in a philosophical system such as Hegel’s is “what is above all understanding” and can, therefore, “never become comprehensible” (ibid., p.162). This endorsement of a claim related to Hölderlin’s about the unknowability of the ultimate ground of conceptual discourse draws to a close the efforts of German Idealism to grasp the whole of reality in conceptual terms. Finally, we must note that Heidegger saw in Hölderlin a prophetic figure, but it was Hölderlin the poet, not the philosopher, whom Heidegger had in mind. In Being and Time, Heidegger first introduces his key idea of the forgetting of the question of Being. His later thought develops this idea which leads to the thought that poetry announces a new clearing of Being. This echoes Hölderlin’s privileging of poetry with respect to conceptual thought. For Heidegger, poetry cannot name the unnameable, but it can keep open the space for it (Heidegger, 1996, 2000). However, Heidegger understands Hölderlin as showing the way to a future clearing of Being. We note that Heidegger’s interpretation is controversial and has been criticised, in particular by Henrich (1992, 1997), for whom Hölderlin is a “recollective” poet. For Henrich, Hölderlin’s work is turned to the past, and to our longings, both for a sense of original unity and for the freedom of the self.

6. Conclusion

Hölderlin’s philosophically relevant output, although very small, is central to a proper understanding of the development of German Idealism from its source in the task of providing a ground for Kant’s critical system to its later attempts to give an all-encompassing philosophical account of reality. Hölderlin’s insights in his theoretical text On Judgment and Being can be seen as relevant to this development. The consequent privileging of poetry over philosophy, of which Hölderlin’s career provides a striking illustration, resonates into the twentieth century in Heidegger’s later thought, but central to Hölderlin’s philosophical contribution is also the practical correlate of his theoretical thought: his novel Hyperion provides a profound insight into his understanding of life’s “eccentric path” as a struggle between the harmony of a lost, original unity and the drive of human beings’ free spirit always to seek the overcoming of any given limits.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Adorno, T.W. (1992) Parataxis: On Hölderlin’s late poetry, in Adorno, Notes to Literature Vol. 2, transl. S.W.Nicholsen, Columbia University Press, New York, pp. 109-149.
  • Ameriks, K. (ed.) (2000) The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Constantine, D. (1988) Hölderlin, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Donelan, J.H. (2002) Hölderlin’s poetic self-consciousness, Philosophy and Literature, 26, 125-142.
  • Fichte, J.G. (1994) Introductions to the Wissenschaftslehre and Other Writings (1797-1800), ed. and transl. D. Breazeale, Hackett, Indianapolis/Cambridge.
  • Förster, E. (1995) ‘To lend wings to physics once again’: Hölderlin and the ‘Oldest System Program of German Idealism’, European Journal of Philosophy, 3(2), 174-198.
  • di Giovanni, G. and Harris, H.S., editors, (2000) Between Kant and
    Hegel: Texts in the Development of Post- Kantian Idealism, Hackett, Indianapolis.
  • Hegel, G.W.F. (1977) Phenomenology of Spirit, transl. A.V.Miller, Oxford University Press, Oxford.
  • Heidegger, M. (2000) Elucidations of Hölderlin’s poetry, transl. K.Hoeller, Humanity Books, New York.
  • Heidegger, M. (1996) Holderlin's Hymn "the Ister", Indiana University Press, Indianapolis.
  • Henrich, D. (1992) Der Grund im Bewuβtsein: Untersuchungen zu Hölderlin’s Denken, 1794-1795, Klett-Cotta, Stuttgart.
  • Henrich, D. (1997) The Course of Remembrance and Other Essays on Hölderlin, ed. E. Förster, Stanford University Press, Stanford.
  • Hölderlin, F. (1972) Über Urtheil und Seyn (On Judgment and Being), in H.S. Harris: ‘Hegel’s Development: Toward the Sunlight 1770-1801’, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Hölderlin, F. (1990) Hyperion and selected poems, ed. Eric L. Santner, Continuum, New York.
  • Hölderlin, F. (1999) Sämtliche Gedichte und Hyperion, Insel Verlag, Frankfurt-am-Main.
  • Ryan, L. (1960) Hölderlin’s Lehre vom Wechsel der Töne, Klett-Cotta, Stuttgart.
  • Schelling, F.W.J. (1994) On the History of Modern Philosophy, transl. A. Bowie, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.
  • Schiller, F. (1982) On the Aesthetic Education of Man in a series of letters, ed. & transl. E.M.Wilkinson & L.A. Willoughby, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Waibel, V. (2000) Hölderlin und Fichte: 1794-1800, Paderborn.

Author Information

Christian J. Onof
University of London
United Kingdom

Thales of Miletus (c. 620 B.C.E.—c. 546 B.C.E.)

thalesThe ancient Greek philosopher Thales was born in Miletus in Greek Ionia. Aristotle, the major source for Thales's philosophy and science, identified Thales as the first person to investigate the basic principles, the question of the originating substances of matter and, therefore, as the founder of the school of natural philosophy. Thales was interested in almost everything, investigating almost all areas of knowledge, philosophy, history, science, mathematics, engineering, geography, and politics. He proposed theories to explain many of the events of nature, the primary substance, the support of the earth, and the cause of change. Thales was much involved in the problems of astronomy and provided a number of explanations of cosmological events which traditionally involved supernatural entities. His questioning approach to the understanding of heavenly phenomena was the beginning of Greek astronomy. Thales' hypotheses were new and bold, and in freeing phenomena from godly intervention, he paved the way towards scientific endeavor. He founded the Milesian school of natural philosophy, developed the scientific method, and initiated the first western enlightenment. A number of anecdotes is closely connected to Thales' investigations of the cosmos. When considered in association with his hypotheses they take on added meaning and are most enlightening. Thales was highly esteemed in ancient times, and a letter cited by Diogenes Laertius, and purporting to be from Anaximenes to Pythagoras, advised that all our discourse should begin with a reference to Thales (D.L. II.4).

Table of Contents

  1. The Writings of Thales
  2. Possible Sources for Aristotle
  3. Thales says Water is the Primary Principle
  4. Thales and Mythology
  5. Thales's Primary Principle
  6. New Ideas about the Earth
    1. The Earth Floats on Water
    2. Thales's Spherical Earth
    3. Earthquake Theory
  7. All Things are Full of God
  8. Thales's Astronomy
    1. The Eclipse of Thales
    2. Setting the Solstices
    3. Thales's Discovery of the Seasons
    4. Thales's Determination of the Diameters of the Sun and the Moon
    5. Ursa Minor
    6. Falling into a Well
  9. Mathematics
    1. The Theorems Attributed to Thales
  10. Crossing the Halys
  11. The Possible Travels of Thales
  12. The Milesian School
  13. The Seven Sages of Ancient Greece
  14. Corner in Oil
  15. The Heritage of Thales
  16. References and Further Reading
  17. Abbreviations

1. The Writings of Thales

Doubts have always existed about whether Thales wrote anything, but a number of ancient reports credit him with writings. Simplicius (Diels, Dox. p. 475) specifically attributed to Thales authorship of the so-called Nautical Star-guide. Diogenes Laertius raised doubts about authenticity, but wrote that 'according to others [Thales] wrote nothing but two treatises, one On the Solstice and one On the Equinox' (D.L. I.23). Lobon of Argus asserted that the writings of Thales amounted to two hundred lines (D.L. I.34), and Plutarch associated Thales with opinions and accounts expressed in verse (Plutarch, De Pyth. or. 18. 402 E). Hesychius, recorded that '[Thales] wrote on celestial matters in epic verse, on the equinox, and much else' (DK, 11A2). Callimachus credited Thales with the sage advice that navigators should navigate by Ursa Minor (D.L. I.23), advice which may have been in writing.

Diogenes mentions a poet, Choerilus, who declared that '[Thales] was the first to maintain the immortality of the soul' (D.L. I.24), and in De Anima, Aristotle's words 'from what is recorded about [Thales]', indicate that Aristotle was working from a written source. Diogenes recorded that '[Thales] seems by some accounts to have been the first to study astronomy, the first to predict eclipses of the sun and to fix the solstices; so Eudemus in his History of Astronomy. It was this which gained for him the admiration of Xenophanes and Herodotus and the notice of Heraclitus and Democritus' (D.L. I.23). Eudemus who wrote a History of Astronomy, and also on geometry and theology, must be considered as a possible source for the hypotheses of Thales. The information provided by Diogenes is the sort of material which he would have included in his History of Astronomy, and it is possible that the titles On the Solstice, and On the Equinox were available to Eudemus. Xenophanes, Herodotus, Heraclitus and Democritus were familiar with the work of Thales, and may have had a work by Thales available to them.

Proclus recorded that Thales was followed by a great wealth of geometers, most of whom remain as honoured names. They commence with Mamercus, who was a pupil of Thales, and include Hippias of Elis, Pythagoras, Anaxagoras, Eudoxus of Cnidus, Philippus of Mende, Euclid, and Eudemus, a friend of Aristotle, who wrote histories of arithmetic, of astronomy, and of geometry, and many lesser known names. It is possible that writings of Thales were available to some of these men.

Any records which Thales may have kept would have been an advantage in his own work. This is especially true of mathematics, of the dates and times determined when fixing the solstices, the positions of stars, and in financial transactions. It is difficult to believe that Thales would not have written down the information he had gathered in his travels, particularly the geometry he investigated in Egypt and his measuring of the height of the pyramid, his hypotheses about nature, and the cause of change.

Proclus acknowledged Thales as the discoverer of a number of specific theorems (A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid's Elements 65. 8-9; 250. 16-17). This suggests that Eudemus, Proclus's source had before him the written records of Thales's discoveries. How did Thales 'prove' his theorems if not in written words and sketches? The works On the Solstice, On the Equinox, which were attributed to Thales (D.L. I.23), and the 'Nautical Star-guide, to which Simplicius referred, may have been sources for the History of Astronomy of Eudemus (D.L. I.23).

2. Possible Sources for Aristotle

There is no direct evidence that any written material of Thales was available to Plato and Aristotle, but there is a surprisingly long list of early writers who could have known Thales, or had access to his works, and these must be considered as possible sources for Plato, Aristotle, and the philosophers and commentators who followed them. Aristotle's wording, 'Thales says', is assertive wording which suggests a reliable source, perhaps writings of Thales himself. Anaximander and Anaximenes were associates of Thales, and would have been familiar with his ideas. Both produced written work. Anaximander wrote in a poetical style (Theophr. ap. Simpl. Phys. fr. 2), and the writing of Anaximenes was simple and unaffected (D.L. II.3). Other philosophers who were credited with written works, who worked on topics similar to those of Thales, and who may have provided material for later writers, are Heraclitus of Ephesus, Anaxagoras of Clazomenae, Alcmaeon, Hippo of Samos, and Hippias of Elis.

3. Thales says Water is the Primary Principle

Aristotle defined wisdom as knowledge of certain principles and causes (Metaph. 982 a2-3). He commenced his investigation of the wisdom of the philosophers who preceded him, with Thales, the first philosopher, and described Thales as the founder of natural philosophy (Metaph. 983 b21-22). He recorded: 'Thales says that it is water'. 'it' is the nature, the archê, the originating principle. For Thales, this nature was a single material substance, water. Despite the more advanced terminology which Aristotle and Plato had created, Aristotle recorded the doctrines of Thales in terms which were available to Thales in the sixth century B.C.E., Aristotle made a definite statement, and presented it with confidence. It was only when Aristotle attempted to provide the reasons for the opinions that Thales held, and for the theories that he proposed, that he sometimes displayed caution.

4. Thales and Mythology

Those who believe that Thales inherited his views from Greek or Near-Eastern sources are wrong. Thales was esteemed in his times as an original thinker, and one who broke with tradition and not as one who conveyed existing mythologies. Aristotle unequivocally recorded Thales's hypothesis on the nature of matter, and proffered a number of conjectures based on observation in favour of Thales's declaration (Metaph. 983 b20-28). His report provided the testimony that Thales supplanted myth in his explanations of the behaviour of natural phenomena. Thales did not derive his thesis from either Greek or non-Greek mythological traditions.

Thales would have been familiar with Homer's acknowledgements of divine progenitors but he never attributed organization or control of the cosmos to the gods. Aristotle recognized the similarity between Thales's doctrine about water and the ancient legend which associates water with Oceanus and Tethys, but he reported that Thales declared water to be the nature of all things. Aristotle pointed to a similarity to traditional beliefs, not a dependency upon them. Aristotle did not call Thales a theologian in the sense in which he designated 'the old poets' (Metaph. 1091 b4) and others, such as Pherecydes, as 'mixed theologians' who did not use 'mythical language throughout' (Metaph. 1091 b9). To Aristotle, the theories of Thales were so obviously different from all that had gone before that they stood out from earlier explanations. Thales's views were not ancient and primitive. They were new and exciting, and the genesis of scientific conjecture about natural phenomena. It was the view for which Aristotle acknowledged Thales as the founder of natural philosophy.

5. Thales's Primary Principle

The problem of the nature of matter, and its transformation into the myriad things of which the universe is made, engaged the natural philosophers, commencing with Thales. For his hypothesis to be credible, it was essential that he could explain how all things could come into being from water, and return ultimately to the originating material. It is inherent in Thales's hypotheses that water had the potentiality to change to the myriad things of which the universe is made, the botanical, physiological, meteorological and geological states. In Timaeus, 49B-C, Plato had Timaeus relate a cyclic process. The passage commences with 'that which we now call "water" ', and describes a theory which was possibly that of Thales. Thales would have recognized evaporation, and have been familiar with traditional views, such as the nutritive capacity of mist and ancient theories about spontaneous generation, phenomena which he may have 'observed', just as Aristotle believed he, himself had (Hist. An. 569 b1; Gen. An. 762 a9-763 a34), and about which Diodorus Siculus (I.7.3-5; 1.10.6), Epicurus (ap. Censorinus, D.N. IV.9), Lucretius (De Rerum Natura , V.783-808) and Ovid (Met. I.416-437) wrote.

When Aristotle reported Thales's pronouncement that the primary principle is water, he made a precise statement: 'Thales says that it [the nature of things] is water' (Metaph. 983 b20), but he became tentative when he proposed reasons which might have justified Thales's decision: '[Thales's] supposition may have arisen from observation . . . ' (Metaph. 983 b22). It was Aristotle's opinion that Thales may have observed, 'that the nurture of all creatures is moist, and that warmth itself is generated from moisture and lives by it; and that from which all things come to be is their first principle' (Metaph. 983 b23-25). Then, in the lines 983 b26-27, Aristotle's tone changed towards greater confidence. He declared: 'Besides this, another reason for the supposition would be that the semina of all things have a moist nature . . . ' (Metaph. 983 b26-27). In continuing the criticism of Thales, Aristotle wrote: 'That from which all things come to be is their first principle' (Metaph. 983 b25).

Simple metallurgy had been practised long before Thales presented his hypotheses, so Thales knew that heat could return metals to a liquid state. Water exhibits sensible changes more obviously than any of the other so-called elements, and can readily be observed in the three states of liquid, vapour and ice. The understanding that water could generate into earth is basic to Thales's watery thesis. At Miletus it could readily be observed that water had the capacity to thicken into earth. Miletus stood on the Gulf of Lade through which the Maeander river emptied its waters. Within living memory, older Milesians had witnessed the island of Lade increasing in size within the Gulf, and the river banks encroaching into the river to such an extent that at Priene, across the gulf from Miletus the warehouses had to be rebuilt closer to the water's edge. The ruins of the once prosperous city-port of Miletus are now ten kilometres distant from the coast and the Island of Lade now forms part of a rich agricultural plain. There would have been opportunity to observe other areas where earth generated from water, for example, the deltas of the Halys, the Ister, about which Hesiod wrote (Theogony, 341), now called the Danube, the Tigris-Euphrates, and almost certainly the Nile. This coming-into-being of land would have provided substantiation of Thales's doctrine. To Thales water held the potentialities for the nourishment and generation of the entire cosmos. Aëtius attributed to Thales the concept that 'even the very fire of the sun and the stars, and indeed the cosmos itself is nourished by evaporation of the waters' (Aëtius, Placita, I.3).

It is not known how Thales explained his watery thesis, but Aristotle believed that the reasons he proposed were probably the persuasive factors in Thales's considerations. Thales gave no role to the Olympian gods. Belief in generation of earth from water was not proven to be wrong until A.D. 1769 following experiments of Antoine Lavoisier, and spontaneous generation was not disproved until the nineteenth century as a result of the work of Louis Pasteur.

6. New Ideas about the Earth

Thales proposed answers to a number of questions about the earth: the question of its support; its shape; its size; and the cause of earthquakes; the dates of the solstices; the size of the sun and moon.

a. The Earth Floats on Water

In De Caelo Aristotle wrote: 'This [opinion that the earth rests on water] is the most ancient explanation which has come down to us, and is attributed to Thales of Miletus (Cael. 294 a28-30). He explained his theory by adding the analogy that the earth is at rest because it is of the nature of wood and similar substances which have the capacity to float on water, although not on air (Cael. 294 a30-b1). In Metaphysics (983 b21) Aristotle stated, quite unequivocally: 'Thales . . . declared that the earth rests on water'. This concept does appear to be at odds with natural expectations, and Aristotle expressed his difficulty with Thales's theory (Cael. 294 a33-294 b6).

Perhaps Thales anticipated problems with acceptance because he explained that it floated because of a particular quality, a quality of buoyancy similar to that of wood. At the busy city-port of Miletus, Thales had unlimited opportunities to observe the arrival and departure of ships with their heavier-than-water cargoes, and recognized an analogy to floating logs. Thales may have envisaged some quality, common to ships and earth, a quality of 'floatiness', or buoyancy. It seems that Thales's hypothesis was substantiated by sound observation and reasoned considerations. Indeed, Seneca reported that Thales had land supported by water and carried along like a boat (Sen. QNat. III.14). Aristotle's lines in Metaphysics indicate his understanding that Thales believed that, because water was the permanent entity, the earth floats on water.

Thales may have reasoned that as a modification of water, earth must be the lighter substance, and floating islands do exist. Herodotus (The Histories, II.156) was impressed when he saw Chemmis, a floating island, about thirty-eight kilometres north-east of Naucratis, the Egyptian trading concession which Thales probably visited. Seneca described floating islands in Lydia: 'There are many light, pumice-like stones of which islands are composed, namely those which float in Lydia' (Sen. QNat., III.25. 7-10). Pliny described several floating islands, the most relevant being the Reed Islands, in Lydia (HN, II.XCVII), and Pliny (the Younger) (Ep. VIII.XX) described a circular floating island, its buoyancy, and the way it moved. Thales could have visited the near-by Reed Islands. He might have considered such readily visible examples to be models of his theory, and he could well have claimed that the observation that certain islands had the capacity to float substantiated his hypothesis that water has the capacity to support earth.

Again it is understood that Thales did not mention any of the gods who were traditionally associated with the simple bodies; we do not hear of Oceanus or Gaia: we read of water and earth. The idea that Thales would have resurrected the gods is quite contrary to the bold, new, non-mythical theories which Thales proposed.

b. Thales's Spherical Earth

Modern commentators assume that Thales regarded the earth as flat, thin, and circular, but there is no ancient testimony to support that opinion. On the contrary, Aristotle may have attributed knowledge of the sphericity of the earth to Thales, an opinion which was later reported by Aëtius (Aët. III. 9-10) and followed by Ps.-Plutarch (Epit. III.10). Aristotle wrote that some think it spherical, others flat and shaped like a drum (Arist. Cael. 293 b33-294 a1), and then attributed belief in a flat earth to Anaximenes, Anaxagoras, and Democritus (Arist. Cael. 294 b14-15). If following chronological order, Aristotle's words, 'some think it spherical', referred to the theory of Thales. Aristotle then followed with the theory of Thales's immediate Milesian successor, Anaximander, and then reported the flat earth view of Anaximenes, the third of the Milesian natural philosophers.

There are several good reasons to accept that Thales envisaged the earth as spherical. Aristotle used these arguments to support his own view (Arist. Cael. 297 b25-298 a8). First is the fact that during a solar eclipse, the shadow caused by the interposition of the earth between the sun and the moon is always convex; therefore the earth must be spherical. In other words, if the earth were a flat disk, the shadow cast during an eclipse would be elliptical. Second, Thales, who is acknowledged as an observer of the heavens, would have observed that stars which are visible in a certain locality may not be visible further to the north or south, a phenomena which could be explained within the understanding of a spherical earth. Third, from mere observation the earth has the appearance of being curved. From observation, it appears that the earth is covered by a dome. When observed from an elevated site, the sky seems to surround the earth, like a dome, to meet the apparently curved horizon. If observed over the seasons, the dome would appear to revolve, with many of the heavenly bodies changing their position in varying degrees, but returning annually to a similar place in the heavens. Through his work in astronomy Thales would almost certainly have become familiar with the night sky and the motion of the heavenly bodies. There is evidence that he gave advice to navigate by Ursa Minor, and was so involved in observation of the stars that he fell into a well. As a result of observations made over a long period of time, Thales could have realized that the motions of the fixed stars could not be explained within the idea of the observable hemispherical dome. During the determination of the size of the rising sun, and again while watching its risings and settings during his work on fixing the solstices, Thales may have realized that much natural phenomena could be explained only within the understanding of the earth as a sphere.

From the shore, a ship can be seen to be descending, gradually, below the horizon, with the hull disappearing from view first, to be followed by masts and sails. If one had a companion observing from a higher point, the companion would see the ship for a long period before it disappeared from view.

Aëtius recorded the different opinions of the shape of the earth that were held by Thales, Anaximander and Anaximenes (III.9-10; III.10; and III.10). Cicero attributed to Thales the earliest construction of a solid celestial globe (Rep. I.XIII.22). Thales's immediate successors proposed theories about the shape of the earth which were quite different from each other, but that is no reason to reject the view that Thales hypothesized a spherical earth. It is not the only occasion on which Anaximander and Anaximenes failed to follow the theories of Thales. That they did not do so is the main argument in favour of accepting that the scientific method commenced in the Milesian School. There is testimony that Thales knew the earth to be spherical, but no evidence to suggest that he proposed any other shape.

c. Earthquake Theory

Thales's theory about the cause of earthquakes is consistent with his hypothesis that earth floats upon water. It seems that he applied his floating on water simile to the natural phenomena of earthquakes. Aëtius recorded that Thales and Democritus found in water the cause of earthquakes (Aët. III.15), and Seneca attributed to Thales a theory that on the occasions when the earth is said to quake it is fluctuating because of the roughness of oceans (QNat. III.14; 6.6). Although the theory is wrong, Thales's hypothesis is rational because it provides an explanation which does not invoke hidden entities. It is an advance upon the traditional Homeric view that they resulted from an angry supernatural god, Poseidon, shaking the earth through his rapid striding.

7. All Things are Full of God

The question of whether Thales endowed the gods with a role in his theories is fundamental to his hypotheses. The relevant text from Aristotle reads: 'Thales, too, to judge from what is recorded of his views, seems to suppose that the soul is in a sense the cause of movement, since he says that a stone [magnet, or lodestone] has a soul because it causes movement to iron' (De An. 405 a20-22); 'Some think that the soul pervades the whole universe, whence perhaps came Thales's view that everything is full of gods' (De An. 411 a7-8). In reference to the clause in the first passage 'to judge from what is recorded of his views', Snell convincingly argued that Aristotle had before him the actual sentence recording Thales's views about the lodestone (Snell, 1944, 170). In the second passage the 'some' to whom Aristotle refers are Leucippus, Democritus, Diogenes of Apollonia, Heraclitus, and Alcmaeon, philosophers who were later than Thales. They adopted and adapted the earlier view of Thales that soul was the cause of motion, permeating and enlivening the entire cosmos. The order in which Aristotle discussed Thales's hypothesis obscures the issue.

The source for Aristotle's report that Thales held all things to be full of gods is unknown, but some presume that it was Plato. Thales is not mentioned in the relevant lines in Plato, but there is a popular misconception that they refer to the belief of Thales. This is wrong. Thales had rejected the old gods. In a passage in Apology(26 C) Socrates identified the heavenly bodies as gods, and pointed out that that was the general understanding. In Cratylus(399 D-E) Plato had Socrates explain a relationship between soul as a life-giving force, the capacity to breathe, and the reviving force. In Timaeus 34B) Plato had Timaeus relate a theory which described soul as pervading the whole universe. Then, in Laws Plato has the Athenian Stranger say: 'Everyone . . . who has not reached the utmost verge of folly is bound to regard the soul as a god. Concerning all the stars and the moon, and concerning the years and months and all seasons, what other account shall we give than this very same, - namely, that, inasmuch as it has been shown that they are all caused by one or more souls . . . we shall declare these souls to be gods . . .? Is there any man that agrees with this view who will stand hearing it denied that 'all things are full of gods'? The response is: 'No man is so wrong-headed as that' (Laws, 899 A-B). Plato had the Athenian Stranger extend his ideas into a theological theory. He used a sleight of hand method to express his own ideas about divine spiritual beings. With the exception of gods in the scheme of things, these passages reflect the beliefs which formed the Thalean hypothesis, but Plato did not have the Athenian Stranger attribute the crucial clause 'all things are full of gods' to Thales. Thales is not mentioned.

Aristotle's text not the earliest extant testimony. Diogenes preserved a report from Hippias: 'Aristotle and Hippias affirm that, arguing from the magnet and from amber, [Thales] attributed a soul or life even to inanimate objects' (D.L. I.24). This early report does not mention godly entities. The later commentators, Cicero (Nat. D. I.X.25), and Stobaeus (Ecl. I.1.11) included gods in Thales's theory. However, their views post-date Stoicism and are distorted by theistic doctrines.

Plato converted the idea of soul into a theory that 'all things are full of gods', and this may have been Aristotle's source, but the idea of gods is contrary to Thales's materialism. When Thales defined reality, he chose an element, not a god. The motive force was not a supernatural being. It was a force within the universe itself. Thales never invoked a power that was not present in nature itself, because he believed that he had recognized a force which underpinned the events of nature.

8. Thales's Astronomy

a. The Eclipse of Thales

Thales is acclaimed for having predicted an eclipse of the sun which occurred on 28 May 585 B.C.E. The earliest extant account of the eclipse is from Herodotus: 'On one occasion [the Medes and the Lydians] had an unexpected battle in the dark, an event which occurred after five years of indecisive warfare: the two armies had already engaged and the fight was in progress, when day was suddenly turned into night. This change from daylight to darkness had been foretold to the Ionians by Thales of Miletus, who fixed the date for it within the limits of the year in which it did, in fact, take place' (Hdt. I.74). The vital points are: Thales foretold a solar eclipse; it did occur within the period he specified. How Thales foretold the eclipse is not known but there is strong opinion that he was able to perform this remarkable feat through knowledge of a cycle known as the Saros, with some attributing his success to use of the Exeligmos cycle. It is not known how Thales was able to predict the Eclipse, if indeed he did, but he could not have predicted the Eclipse by using the Saros or the Exeligmos cycles.

In addition to Herodotus, the successful prediction of the eclipse was accepted by Eudemus in his History of Astronomy and acknowledged by a number of other writers of ancient times (Cicero, Pliny, Dercyllides, Clement, Eusebius). This is how Diogenes Laertius recorded the event: '[Thales] seems by some accounts to have been the first to study astronomy, the first to predict eclipses of the sun, and to fix the solstices; so Eudemus in his History of Astronomy. It was this which gained for him the admiration of Xenophanes and Herodotus and the notice of Heraclitus and Democritus' (D.L. I.23). Diogenes asserted that Herodotus knew of Thales's work, and in naming Xenophanes, Heraclitus, and Democritus, he nominated three of the great pre-Socratics, eminent philosophers who were familiar with the work of Thales.

Modern astronomy confirms that the eclipse did occur, and was total. According to Herodotus's report, the umbra of the eclipse of Thales must have passed over the battle field. The "un-naturalness" of a solar eclipse is eerie and chilling. All becomes hushed and there is a strong uncanny sensation of impending disaster, of being within the control of some awful power. In ancient times, the awesome phenomenon must have aroused great fear, anxiety and wonder. The combatants saw the eclipse as disapproval of their warfare, and as a warning. They ceased fighting and a peace agreement was reached between the two kings.

It is not known why Thales turned away from the traditional beliefs which attributed all natural events and man's fortunes and misfortunes to the great family of Olympian gods, but Miletus was the most prosperous of the Ionian cities, and it cannot be doubted that the flourishing merchants believed that their prosperity resulted from their own initiative and endeavours. Thales's great philosophical pronouncement that water is the basic principle shows that Thales gave no acknowledgement to the gods as instigators and controllers of phenomena. Thales's hypotheses indicate that he envisaged phenomena as natural events with natural causes and possible of explanation. From his new perspective of observation and reasoning, Thales studied the heavens and sought explanations of heavenly phenomena.

It is widely accepted that Thales acquired information from Near-Eastern sources and gained access to the extensive records which dated from the time of Nabonassar (747 B.C.E.) and which were later used by Ptolemy (Alm. III.7. H 254). Some commentators have suggested that Thales predicted the solar eclipse of 585 B.C.E. through knowledge of the Saros period, a cycle of 223 lunar months (18 years, 10-11 days plus 0.321124 of a day) after which eclipses both of the sun and moon repeat themselves with very little change, or through knowledge of the Exeligmos cycle which is exactly three times the length of the Saros (Ptolemy, Alm. IV.2. H270). The ancients could not have predicted solar eclipses on the basis of those periodic cycles because eclipses of the sun do not repeat themselves with very little change. The extra 0.321124 of a day means that each recurring solar eclipse will be visible to the west, just under one-third of the circumference of the earth, being a period of time of almost 7.7 hours. This regression to the west could not have been known to the ancient astrologers, a fact which seems not to have been taken into account by the philosophers who attribute Thales's success to application of one of those two cycles.

The following important fact should be noted. Some commentators and philosophers believe that Thales may have witnessed the solar eclipse of 18th May 603 B.C.E. or have had heard of it. They accepted that he had predicted the solar eclipse of 28 May 585 B.C.E. and reasoned from the astronomical fact of the Saros cycles and the fact that the two solar eclipses had been separated by the period of 18 years, 10 days, and 7.7 hours, and concluded that Thales had been able to predict a solar eclipse based upon the knowledge of that cycle. Two facts discount rebut those claims. First, recent research shows that the solar eclipse of 18th May 603 B.C.E. would not have been visible in Egypt, nor in the Babylonian observation cities where the astronomers watched the heavens for expected and unusual heavenly events. The eclipse of 603 passed over the Persian Gulf, too far to the south for observation (Stephenson, personal communication, March 1999; and Stephenson, "Long-term Fluctuations", 165-202). Even if the eclipse of 603 had been visible to the Near-Eastern astronomers, it is not possible to recognize a pattern from witnessing one event, or indeed, from witnessing two events. One may suggest a pattern after witnessing three events that are separated by equal periods of time, but the eclipse which preceded that of 603, and which occurred on 6th May 621, was not visible in Near-Eastern regions. Consequently, it could not have been recorded by the astrologer/priests who watched for unusual heavenly phenomena, and could not have been seen as forming a pattern.

It is quite wrong to say that eclipses repeat themselves with very little change, because each solar eclipse in a particular Saros occurs about 7.7 hours later than in the previous eclipse in the same Saros, and that is about 1/3 of the circumference of the earth's circumference. Adding to the difficulty of recognizing a particular cycle is the fact that about forty-two periodic cycles are in progress continuously, and overlapping at any time. Every series in a periodic cycle lasts about 1,300 years and comprises 73 eclipses. Eclipses which occur in one periodic cycle are unrelated to eclipses in other periodic cycles.

The ancient letters prove that the Babylonians and Assyrians knew that lunar eclipses can occur only at full moon, and solar eclipses only at new moon, and also that eclipses occur at intervals of five or six months. However, while lunar eclipses are visible over about half the globe, solar eclipses are visible from only small areas of the earth's surface. Recent opinion is that, as early as 650 B.C.E. the Assyrian astronomers seem to have recognized the six months-five months period by which they could isolate eclipse possibilities (Steele, "Eclipse Prediction", 429).

In other recent research Britton has analysed a text known as Text S, which provides considerable detail and fine analysis of lunar phenomena dating from Nabonassar in 747 B.C.E. The text points to knowledge of the six-month five month periods. Britton believes that the Saros cycle was known before 525 B.C.E. (Britton, "Scientific Astronomy", 62) but, although the text identifies a particular Saros cycle, and graphically depicts the number of eclipse possibilities, the ancient commentary of Text S does not attest to an actual observation (Britton, "An Early Function", 32).

There is no evidence that the Saros could have been used for the prediction of solar eclipses in the sixth century B.C.E., but it remains possible that forthcoming research, and the transliteration of more of the vast stock of ancient tablets will prove that the Babylonians and Assyrians had a greater knowledge of eclipse phenomena than is now known.

The Babylonian and Assyrian astronomers knew of the Saros period in relation to lunar eclipses, and had some success in predicting lunar eclipses but, in the sixth century B.C.E. when Thales lived and worked, neither the Saros nor the Exeligmos cycles could be used to predict solar eclipses.

It is testified that Thales knew that the sun is eclipsed when the moon passes in front of it, the day of eclipse - called the thirtieth by some, new moon by others (The Oxyrhynchus Papyri, 3710). Aëtius (II.28) recorded: [Thales] says that eclipses of the sun take place when the moon passes across it in a direct line, since the moon is earthy in character; and it seems to the eye to be laid on the disc of the sun'.

There is a possibility that, through analysis of ancient eclipse records, Thales identified another cycle, the lunar eclipse-solar eclipse cycle of 23 1/2 months, the fact that a solar eclipse is a possibility 23 1/2 months after a lunar eclipse. However, lunar eclipses are not always followed by solar eclipses. Although the possibility is about 57% it is important to note that the total solar eclipse of 28th May, 585, occurred 23 1/2months after the total lunar eclipse of 4th July, 587. The wording of the report of the eclipse by Herodotus: 'Thales . . . fixed the date for the eclipse within the limits of the year' is precise, and suggests that Thales's prediction was based upon a definite eclipse theory.

b. Setting the Solstices

A report from Theon of Smyrna ap. Dercyllides states that: 'Eudemus relates in the Astronomy that Thales was the first to discover the eclipse of the sun and that its period with respect to the solstices is not always constant' (DK, 11 A 17). Diogenes Laertius (I.24) recorded that [Thales] was the first to determine the sun's course from solstice to solstice, and also acknowledged the Astronomy of Eudemus as his source.

Solstices are natural phenomena which occur on June 21 or 22, and December 21 or 22, but the determination of the precise date on which they occur is difficult. This is because the sun seems to 'stand still' for several days because there is no discernible difference in its position in the sky. It is the reason why the precise determination of the solstices was so difficult. It was a problem which engaged the early astronomers, and more than seven centuries later, Ptolemy acknowledged the difficulty (Alm. III.1. H203).

It is not known how Thales proceeded with his determination, but the testimony of Flavius Philostratus is that: '[Thales] observed the heavenly bodies . . . from [Mount] Mycale which was close by his home' (Philostratus, Life of Apollonius , II.V). This suggests that Thales observed the rising and setting of the sun for many days at mid-summer and mid-winter (and, necessarily, over many years). Mount Mycale, being the highest point in the locality of Miletus, would provide the perfect vantage point from which to make observations. Another method which Thales could have employed was to measure the length of the noon-day sun around mid-summer and mid-winter. Again this would require observations to be made, and records kept over many days near the solstice period, and over many years.

c. Thales's Discovery of the Seasons

From Diogenes Laertius we have the report: '[Thales] is said to have discovered the seasons of the year and divided it into 365 days' (D.L. I.27). Because Thales had determined the solstices, he would have known of the number of days between say, summer solstices, and therefore have known the length of a solar year. It is consistent with his determination of the solstices that he should be credited with discovering that 365 days comprise a year. It is also a fact that had long been known to the Egyptians who set their year by the more reliable indicator of the annual rising of the star Sirius in July. Thales may have first gained the knowledge of the length of the year from the Egyptians, and perhaps have attempted to clarify the matter by using a different procedure. Thales certainly did not 'discover' the seasons, but he may have identified the relationship between the solstices, the changing position during the year of the sun in the sky, and associated this with seasonal climatic changes.

d. Thales's Determination of the Diameters of the Sun and the Moon

Apuleius wrote that 'Thales in his declining years devised a marvellous calculation about the sun, showing how often the sun measures by its own size the circle which it describes'. (Apul. Florida, 18). Following soon after Apuleius, Cleomedes explained that the calculation could be made by running a water-clock, from which the result was obtained: the diameter of the sun is found to be one seven-hundred-and-fiftieth of its own orbit (Cleomedes, De Motu circulari corporum caelestium, II.75). The third report is from Diogenes: 'According to some [Thales was] the first to declare the size of the sun to be one seven hundred and twentieth part of the solar circle, and the size of the moon to be the same fraction of the lunar circle' (D.L. I.24). Little credence can be given to the water-clock method for reaching this determination, because there is an inbuilt likelihood of repeated errors over the 24 hour period. Even Ptolemy, who flourished in the second century A.D., rejected all measurements which were made by means of water-clocks, because of the impossibility of attaining accuracy by such means (Alm. V.14. H416).

In his work in geometry, Thales was engaged in circles and angles, and their characteristics, and he could have arrived at his solution to the problem by applying the geometrical knowledge he had acquired. There is no evidence to support a suggestion that Thales was familiar with measurements by degrees but he could have learnt, from the Babylonians, that a circle is divided into 3600. The figure of 720, which was given by Diogenes for Thales, is double 360, and this is related to the Babylonian sexagesimal system. To establish the dates of the solstices, Thales probably made repeated observations of the risings and settings of the sun. From such experiments he could have observed that the angle which was subtended by the elevation of the rising sun is 1/20 and with 3600 in a circle, the ratio of 1:720 is determined.

Of the report from Diogenes Laertius (D.L. I.24) that Thales also determined the orbit of the moon in relation to the size of its diameter, Thales would repeat the method to calculate the orbit of the moon.

e. Ursa Minor

Callimachus (D.L. I.22) reported that Thales 'discovered' Ursa Minor. This means only that he recognized the advantages of navigating by Ursa Minor, rather than by Ursa Major, as was the preferred method of the Greeks. Ursa Minor, a constellation of six stars, has a smaller orbit than does the Great Bear, which means that, as it circles the North Pole, Ursa Minor changes its position in the sky to a lesser degree than does the Great Bear. Thales offered this sage advice to the mariners of Miletus, to whom it should have been of special value because Miletus had developed a maritime trade of economic importance.

f. Falling into a Well

In Theaetetus (174 A) Plato had Socrates relate a story that Thales was so intent upon watching the stars that he failed to watch where he was walking, and fell into a well. The story is also related by Hippolytus (Diels, Dox. 555), and by Diogenes Laertius (D.L. II.4-5). Irony and jest abound in Plato's writing and he loved to make fun of the pre-Socratics, but he is not likely to have invented the episode, especially as he had Socrates relate the event. Aristotle wrote that viewing the heavens through a tube 'enables one to see further' (Gen. An. 780 b19-21), and Pliny (HN, II.XI) wrote that: 'The sun's radiance makes the fixed stars invisible in daytime, although they are shining as much as in the night, which becomes manifest at a solar eclipse and also when the star is reflected in a very deep well'. Thales was renowned and admired for his astronomical studies, and he was credited with the 'discovery' of Ursa Minor (D.L. I.23). If Thales had heard that stars could be viewed to greater advantage from wells, either during day or night, he would surely have made an opportunity to test the theory, and to take advantage of a method that could assist him in his observations. The possibility that the story was based on fact should not be overlooked. Plato had information which associated Thales with stars, a well, and an accident. Whether Thales fell into a well, or tripped when he was getting in or out of a well, the story grew up around a mishap.

9. Mathematics

The practical skill of land measurement was invented in Egypt because of the necessity frequently to remeasure plots of land after destructive inundations. The phenomena is well described by Herodotus (II.93-109). Egypt was believed to be the source of much wisdom and reports tell us that many Greeks, including Thales, Pythagoras, Solon, Herodotus, Plato, Democritus, and Euclid, visited that ancient land to see the wonders for themselves.

The Egyptians had little to offer in the way of abstract thought. The surveyors were able to measure and to calculate and they had outstanding practical skills. In Egypt Thales would have observed the land surveyors, those who used a knotted cord to make their measurements, and were known as rope-stretchers. Egyptian mathematics had already reached its heights when The Rhind Mathematical Papyrus was written in about 1800 B.C.E. More than a thousand years later, Thales would have watched the surveyors as they went about their work in the same manner, measuring the land with the aid of a knotted rope which they stretched to measure lengths and to form angles.

The development of geometry is preserved in a work of Proclus, A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid's Elements (64.12-65.13). Proclus provided a remarkable amount of intriguing information, the vital points of which are the following: Geometry originated in Egypt where it developed out of necessity; it was adopted by Thales who had visited Egypt, and was introduced into Greece by him

The Commentary of Proclus indicates that he had access to the work of Euclid and also to The History of Geometry which was written by Eudemus of Rhodes, a pupil of Aristotle, but which is no longer extant. His wording makes it clear that he was familiar with the views of those writers who had earlier written about the origin of geometry. He affirmed the earlier views that the rudiments of geometry developed in Egypt because of the need to re-define the boundaries, just as Herodotus stated.

a. The Theorems Attributed to Thales

Five Euclidean theorems have been explicitly attributed to Thales, and the testimony is that Thales successfully applied two theorems to the solution of practical problems.

Thales did not formulate proofs in the formal sense. What Thales did was to put forward certain propositions which, it seems, he could have 'proven' by induction: he observed the similar results of his calculations: he showed by repeated experiment that his propositions and theorems were correct, and if none of his calculations resulted in contrary outcomes, he probably felt justified in accepting his results as proof. Thalean 'proof' was often really inductive demonstration. The process Thales used was the method of exhaustion. This seems to be the evidence from Proclus who declared that Thales 'attacked some problems in a general way and others more empirically'.

DEFINITION I.17: A diameter of the circle is a straight line drawn through the centre and terminated in both directions by the circumference of the circle; and such a straight line also bisects the circle (Proclus, 124). >

PROPOSITION I.5: In isosceles triangles the angles at the base are equal; and if the equal straight lines are produced further, the angles under the base will be equal (Proclus, 244). It seems that Thales discovered only the first part of this theorem for Proclus reported: We are indebted to old Thales for the discovery of this and many other theorems. For he, it is said, was the first to notice and assert that in every isosceles the angles at the base are equal, though in somewhat archaic fashion he called the equal angles similar (Proclus, 250.18-251.2).

PROPOSITION I.15: 'If two straight lines cut one another, they make the vertical angles equal to one another' (Proclus, 298.12-13). This theorem is positively attributed to Thales. Proof of the theorem dates from the Elements of Euclid (Proclus, 299.2-5).

PROPOSITION I.26: 'If two triangles have the two angles equal to two angles respectively, and one side equal to one side, namely, either the side adjoining the equal angles, or that subtending one of the equal angles, they will also have the remaining sides equal to the remaining sides and the remaining angle equal to the remaining angle' (Proclus, 347.13-16). 'Eudemus in his history of geometry attributes the theorem itself to Thales, saying that the method by which he is reported to have determined the distance of ships at sea shows that he must have used it' (Proclus, 352.12-15). Thales applied this theorem to determine the height of a pyramid. The great pyramid was already over two thousand years old when Thales visited Gizeh, but its height was not known. Diogenes recorded that 'Hieronymus informs us that [Thales] measured the height of the pyramids by the shadow they cast, taking the observation at the hour when our shadow is of the same length as ourselves' (D.L. I.27). Pliny (HN, XXXVI.XVII.82) and Plutarch (Conv. sept. sap. 147) also recorded versions of the event. Thales was alerted by the similarity of the two triangles, the 'quality of proportionality'. He introduced the concept of ratio, and recognized its application as a general principle. Thales's accomplishment of measuring the height of the pyramid is a beautiful piece of mathematics. It is considered that the general principle in Euclid I.26 was applied to the ship at sea problem, would have general application to other distant objects or land features which posed difficulties in the calculation of their distances.

PROPOSITION III.31: 'The angle in a semicircle is a right angle'. Diogenes Laertius (I.27) recorded: 'Pamphila states that, having learnt geometry from the Egyptians, [Thales] was the first to inscribe a right-angled triangle in a circle, whereupon he sacrificed an ox'. Aristotle was intrigued by the fact that the angle in a semi-circle is always right. In two works, he asked the question: 'Why is the angle in a semicircle always a right angle?' (An. Post. 94 a27-33; Metaph. 1051 a28). Aristotle described the conditions which are necessary if the conclusion is to hold, but did not add anything that assists with this problem.

It is testified that it was from Egypt that Thales acquired the rudiments of geometry. However, the evidence is that the Egyptian skills were in orientation, measurement, and calculation. Thales's unique ability was with the characteristics of lines, angles and circles. He recognized, noticed and apprehended certain principles which he probably 'proved' through repeated demonstration.

10. Crossing the Halys

Herodotus recorded 'the general belief of the Greeks' that Thales assisted Croesus in transporting his troops across the Halys river (Hdt. I.75) on his advance into Capadoccia to engage the great Persian conqueror, Cyrus who threatened from the east. Herodotus provided a detailed description of the reported crossing which many of the Greeks supposed had been accomplished through Thales's engineering skills and ingenuity (Hdt. I.75). Herodotus had been told that Thales advised Croesus to divide the river into two parts. The story is that Thales directed the digging so that the river was diverted into two smaller streams, each of which could then be forded. The story from Herodotus describes a formation similar to an oxbow lake. The work could have been undertaken by the men of Croesus's army, and directed by Thales. With both channels then being fordable, Croesus could lead his army across the Halys. This description complies with 'the general belief of the Greeks' which Herodotus related.

However, Herodotus did not accept that story, because he believed that bridges crossed the river at that time (I.74). Herodotus's misgivings were well founded. There is considerable support for the argument that Croesus and his army crossed the Halys by the bridge which already existed and travelled by the Royal Road which provided the main access to the East. Herodotus explained that at the Halys there were gates which had to be passed before one crossed the river, which formed the border, with the post being strongly guarded (Hdt. V.52).

The town of Cesnir Kopru, or Tcheshnir Keupreu, is a feasible site for a crossing. Before the industrialization of the area, a mediaeval bridge was observed, underneath which, when the river was low, could be seen not only the remains of its Roman predecessor but the roughly hewn blocks of a much earlier bridge (Garstang, 1959, 2). Any clues that may have helped to provide an answer to the question of whether there were bridges in the time of Croesus are now submerged by the hydroelectric plants which have been built in the area. Herodotus recorded the details that he had obtained, but used his own different understanding of the situation to discount the report.

11. The Possible Travels of Thales

Establishing whether or not Thales travelled and what countries he visited is important because we may be able to establish what information he could have acquired from other sources. In Epinomis 987 E) Plato made the point that the Greeks took from foreigners what was of value and developed their notions into better ideas.

Eudemus, who was one of Aristotle's students, believed that Thales had travelled to Egypt (Eudemus ap. Proclus, 65.7). A number of ancient sources support that opinion, including Pamphila who held that he spent time with the Egyptian priests (D.L. I.24), Hieronymus from whose report we learn that Thales measured the height of the pyramids by the shadow they cast (D.L. I.27), and Plutarch (De Is. et Os. 131). Thales gave an explanation for the inundation (D.L. I.37). He may have devised this explanation after witnessing the phenomena, which Herodotus later described (Hdt. II.97).

By 620 B.C.E., and perhaps earlier, Miletus held a trading concession at Naucratis (Hdt. II.178, Strab. 17.1.18) on the Canopic mouth of the Nile, and it is possible that Thales visited Egypt on a trading mission. Travel to Egypt would not have been difficult. Homer had Ulysses sailing from Crete to the Nile in five days, and Ernle Bradford recently made a similar journey, proving the trip to be feasible (Bradford, Ulysses Found, 26, and passim). The wealth of Miletus was the result of its success as a trading centre, and there would have been no difficulty in arranging passage on one of the many vessels which traded through of Miletus.

Josephus (Contra Apionem I.2) wrote that Thales was a disciple of the Egyptians and the Chaldeans which suggests that he visited the Near-East. It is thought that Thales visited the Babylonians and Chaldeans and had access to the astrological records which enabled him to predict the solar eclipse of 585 B.C.E.

Miletus had founded many colonies around the Mediterranean and especially along the coasts of the Black Sea. Pliny (HN, V.31.112) gives the number as ninety. The Milesians traded their goods for raw materials, especially iron and timber, and tunny fish. Strabo made mention of 'a sheep-industry', and the yield of 'soft wool' (Strabo, 12.3.13), and Aristophanes mentioned the fine and luxurious Milesian wool (Lysistrata, 729; Frogs, 543). The Milesian traders had access to the hinterland. The land around the mouth of the Halys was fertile, 'productive of everything . . . and planted with olive trees' (Strabo, 12.3.12-13). Thales was associated with a commercial venture in the production of olive oil in Miletus and Chios, but his interests may have extended beyond those two places. Olive oil was a basic item in the Mediterranean diet, and was probably a trading commodity of some importance to Milesian commerce.

It is likely that Thales was one of the 'great teachers' who, according to Herodotus, visited Croesus in the Lydian capital, Sardis (Hdt. I.30). From Sardis, he could have joined a caravan to make the three-month journey along the well used Royal Road (Hdt. V.53), to visit the observatories in Babylonia, and seek the astronomical knowledge which they had accumulated over centuries of observation of heavenly phenomena. In about 547 B.C.E. late in his life, Thales travelled into Cappadocia with Croesus, and, according to some belief, devised a scheme by which the army of Croesus was able to cross the River Halys. Milesian merchantmen continually plied the Black Sea, and gaining a passage could have been easily arranged. From any number of ports Thales could have sought information, and from Sinope he may have ventured on the long journey to Babylonia, perhaps travelling along the valley of the Tigris, as Xenophon did in 401-399 B.C.E.

In a letter purported to be from Thales to Pherecydes, Thales stated that he and Solon had both visited Crete, and Egypt to confer with the priests and astronomers, and all over Hellas and Asia (D.L. I.43-44). All that should be gleaned from such reports, is that travel was not exceptional, with many reports affirming the visits of mainly notable people to foreign lands. Alcaeus visited Egypt' (Strabo, 1.2.30), and his brother, Antimenidas, served in Judaea in the army of the Babylonian monarch, King Nebuchadrezzar. Sappho went into exile in Sicily, her brother,Charaxus, spent some time in Egypt, and a number of friends of Sappho visited Sardis where they lived in Lydian society. There must have been any number of people who visited foreign lands, about whom we know nothing.

Very little about the travels of Thales may be stated with certainty, but it seems probable that he would have sought information from any sources of knowledge and wisdom, particularly the centres of learning in the Near-East. It is accepted that there was ample opportunity for travel.

12. Milesian School

Thales was the founder of a new school of philosophy (Arist. Metaph. 983 b20). His two fellow Milesians who also engaged in the new questioning approach to the understanding of the universe, were Anaximander, his disciple (D.L. I.13), and Anaximenes, who was the disciple of Anaximander (D.L. II.2). Anaximander was about ten years younger than Thales, but survived him by only a year, dying in about 545. Anaximenes was born in 585 and died in about 528. Their lives all overlapped. Through their association they comprised the Milesian School: They all worked on similar problems, the nature of matter and the nature of change, but they each proposed a different material as the primary principle, which indicates that there was no necessity to follow the master's teachings or attribute their discoveries to him. Each proposed a different support for the earth. Thales was held in high regard for his wisdom, being acclaimed as the most eminent of the Wise Men of Ancient Greece, but he was not regarded as a god, as Pythagoras was. Anaximander and Anaximenes were free to pursue their own ideas and to express them in writing. This surely suggests that they engaged in critical discussion of the theories of each other. The Greeks are a sociable people, and their willingness to converse brought rewards in knowledge gained, as Plato remarked (Epinomis, 987E). Critical discussion implies more than familiarity with other views, and more than mere disagreement with other theories. It is the adoption, or in this case, the development, of a new style of discussion. It is a procedure which encourages questioning, debate, explanation, justification and criticism. There was a unique relationship between the three Milesians and it is highly probable that the critical method developed in the Milesian School under the leadership of Thales.

13. The Seven Sages of Ancient Greece

The earliest reference to the Seven Sages of Ancient Greece is in Plato's Protagoras in which he listed seven names: 'A man's ability to utter such remarks [notable, short and compressed] is to be ascribed to his perfect education. Such men were Thales of Miletus, Pittacus of Mitylene, Bias of Priene, Solon of our city [Athens], Cleobulus of Lindus, Myson of Chen, and, last of the traditional seven, Chilon of Sparta. . . . and you can recognize that character in their wisdom by the short memorable sayings that fell from each of them' (Protagoras, 342 E-343 A).

Diogenes recorded that 'Thales was the first to receive the name of Sage in the archonship of Damasias at Athens, when the term was applied to all the Seven Sages, as Demetrius of Phalerum [born. ca. 350 B.C] mentions in his List of Archons (D.L. I.22). Demetrius cannot have been the source for Plato, who died when Demetrius was only three years old. Perhaps there was a source common to both Plato and Demetrius, but it is unknown.

Damasias was archon in 582/1. It may be significant that at this time the Pythian Games were re-organized. More events were added and, for the first time, they were to be held at intervals of four years, in the third year of the Olympiad, instead of the previous eight-yearly intervals. Whether there is an association between the re-organization of the Pythian Games and the inauguration of the Seven Sages in not known but, as Pausanias indicates, the Seven were selected from all around Greece: 'These [the sages] were: from Ionia, Thales of Miletus and Bias of Priene; of the Aeolians in Lesbos, Pittacus of Mitylene; of the Dorians in Asia, Cleobulus of Lindus; Solon of Athens and Chilon of Sparta; the seventh sage, according to the list of Plato, the son of Ariston is not Periander, the son of Cypselus, but Myson of Chenae, a village on Mount Oeta' (Paus. 14.1). The purpose of Damasias may have been aimed at establishing unity between the city-states.

It is difficult to believe that the Seven all assembled at Delphi, although the dates just allow it. Plato wrote that their notable maxims were featured at Delphi: 'They [the Sages], assembled together and dedicated these [short memorable sayings] as the first-fruits of their lore to Apollo in his Delphic temple, inscribing there those maxims which are on every tongue - "Know thyself' and "Nothing overmuch" ' (Pl. Prt. 343 A-B).

Plato regarded wise maxims as the most essential of the criteria for a sage, and associated them with wisdom and with good education, but he has Socrates say: 'Think again of all the ingenious devices in arts or other achievements, such as you might expect in one of practical ability; you might remember Thales of Miletus and Anacharsis the Scythian' (Respublica , 600 A). Practical ability was clearly important.

Several other lists were compiled: Hippobotus (D.L. I.42); Pittacus (D.L. I.42); and Diogenes (D.L. I.13. They omitted some names and adding others. In his work On the Sages, Hermippus reckons seventeen, which included most of the names listed by other compilers.

Many commentators state that Thales was named as Sage because of the practical advice he gave to Miletus in particular, and to Ionia in general. The earlier advice was to his fellow Milesians. In 560, the thirty-five year old Croesus (Hdt. I.25) succeeded his father Alyattes and continued the efforts begun by his father to subdue the Milesians, but without success. Diogenes tells us that 'when Croesus sent to Miletus offering terms of alliance, [Thales] frustrated the plan' (D.L. I.25). The second occasion was at an even later date, when the power of Cyrus loomed as a threat from the east. Thales's advice to the Ionian states was to unite in a political alliance, so that their unified strength could be a defence against the might of Cyrus. This can hardly have been prior to 550 B.C.E. which is thirty years later than the promulgation of the Seven Sages. Thales was not named as a Sage because of any political advice which is extant.

One of the few dates in Thales's life which can be known with certainty is the date of the Eclipse of 585 B.C.E. It brought to a halt the battle being fought between Alyattes and the Mede, Cyaxares and, in addition, brought peace to the region after 'five years of indecisive warfare' (Hdt. I.74). The Greeks believed that Thales had predicted the Eclipse, and perhaps even regarded him as being influential in causing the phenomenon to occur. This was reason enough to declare Thales to be a man of great wisdom and to designate him as the first of the Seven Sages of Ancient Greece.

14. Corner in Oil

Thales's reputation for wisdom is further enhanced in a story which was related by Aristotle. (Politics, 1259 a 6-23). Somehow, through observation of the heavenly bodies, Thales concluded that there would be a bumper crop of olives. He raised the money to put a deposit on the olive presses of Miletus and Chios, so that when the harvest was ready, he was able to let them out at a rate which brought him considerable profit. In this way, Thales answered those who reproached him for his poverty. As Aristotle points out, the scheme has universal application, being nothing more than a monopoly. There need not have been a bumper harvest for the scheme to have been successful. It is quite likely that Thales was involved in commercial ventures, possibly the export of olive oil, and Plutarch reported that Thales was said to have engaged in trade (Plut. Vit. Sol. II.4).

15. The Heritage of Thales

Thales is the first person about whom we know to propose explanations of natural phenomena which were materialistic rather than mythological or theological. His theories were new, bold, exciting, comprehensible, and possible of explanation. He did not speak in riddles as did Heraclitus, and had no need to invent an undefined non-substance, as Anaximander did. Because he gave no role to mythical beings, Thales's theories could be refuted. Arguments could be put forward in attempts to discredit them. Thales's hypotheses were rational and scientific. Aristotle acknowledged Thales as the first philosopher, and criticized his hypotheses in a scientific manner.

The most outstanding aspects of Thales's heritage are: The search for knowledge for its own sake; the development of the scientific method; the adoption of practical methods and their development into general principles; his curiosity and conjectural approach to the questions of natural phenomena - In the sixth century B.C.E., Thales asked the question, 'What is the basic material of the cosmos?' The answer is yet to be discovered.

16. References and Further Reading

  • Ernle Bradford. Ulysses Found. London: Hodder and Stoughton, 1964.
  • Britton, John P. "An Early Function for Eclipse Magnitudes in Babylonian Astronomy." Centaurus, 32 (1989): 32.
  • Britton, John P. "Scientific Astronomy in Pre-Seleucid Babylon." Chapter in H.D. Galter, Die Rolle der Astronomy in den Kulteren Mesopotamiens. Graz: 1993.
  • Garstang, John and O.R. Gurney. The Geography of the Hittite Empire. Occasional Publications of The British Institute of Archaeology in Ankara, no. 5. London: The British Institute of Archaeology at Ankara, 1959.
  • Proclus. A Commentary on the First Book of Euclid's Elements. Translated with an Introduction and Notes by Glenn R Morrow. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1970.
  • Ptolemy. Ptolemy'snAlmagest. Translated and Annotated by G.J. Toomer. London: Duckworth, 1984.
  • Snell, Bruno. "Die Nachrichten über die Lehren des Thales und die Anfänge der griechischen Philosophie - und Literaturgeschichte." [The News about the Teachings of Thales and the Beginnings of the Greek History of Philosophy and Literature], Philologus 96 (1944): 170-182.
  • Steele, John M."Eclipse Prediction in Mesopotamia." Archive for History of Exact Science 54 (5) (2000):421-454.
  • Stephenson, F. Richard, and L.V. Morrison. "Long-term fluctuations in the Earth's rotation: 700 BC to AD 1990." Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society of London351 (1995): 165-202.

17. Abbreviations

  • Aristotle, An. Post., Analytica Posteriora; Cael., De Caelo; De An., De Anima; Gen An., De Generatione Animalium; Hist. An., Historia Animalium; Metaph., Metaphysics; Pol., Politics; Hist. An.; Historia Animalium
  • Cicero, Rep., De Republica; Nat. D., De Natura Deorum
  • D.L., Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers
  • Diels,Dox., H. Diels, Doxographi Graeci
  • DK, Diels, Hermann and Walther Kranz.Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Zurich: Weidmann, 1985.
  • Epicurus, ap.Censorinus, D.N.; Censorinus, De die natali
  • Ovid,Met., Metamorphoses
  • Plutarch,Plut. De Is. et Os., De Iside et Osiride; De Pyth. or., De Pythiae oraculis; Conv. sept. sap., Convivium septem sapientium, [The Dinner of the Seven Wise Men];; Vit. Sol., Vitae Parallelae, Solon
  • Pliny (the Elder), HN: Naturalis Historia
  • Pliny (the Younger), Ep: Epistulae
  • Ps.-Plutarch, Epit;Pseudo-Plutarch, Epitome
  • Seneca, QNat., Quaestiones Naturales
  • Stobaeus, Ecl., jEklogaiv ['Selections']
  • Theophr. ap. Simpl. Phys., Theophrastus, ap. Simplicius, in Physics

Author Information

Patricia O'Grady
The Flinders University of South Australia

Sengzhao (Seng-Chao c. 378—413 C.E.)

Sengzhao (Seng-Chao) was a Buddhist monk who lived during China’s “Period of Disunity” between the stability of the Han and Tang dynasties.  His Zhaolun (Treatises of [Seng]zhao) is perhaps the most significant text for the study of early Mādhyamika (“middle-ist”) or Sanlun (“Three-Treatise”) Buddhism in China.  His work may be the only extensive compilation of early Chinese Mādhyamika treatises available, although no Mādhyamika “school” is likely to have existed in China until Jizang (549-623 C.E.) projected such a lineage back to the time of Sengzhao.  Mādhyamika, a philosophical development that arose within Mahāyāna Buddhism in India during the first few centuries CE, concentrates on distinguishing between concepts and ideas as necessary but insubstantial tools for functioning within the world of conventional reality and the false sense of duality between subject and object that they often engender.  As Sengzhao puts it in his Commentary to the Vimalakīrtinirdesha Sūtra: “Those things which are find their genesis in the mind; [those things] which originate in the mind arise from things. That region of affirmation and negation is a place of illusion.”  Considered to have been a brilliant young monk who was the principal person responsible for the transmission of  Mādhyamika teaching in China, Sengzhao has received a great deal of attention from scholars interested in resolving the question of the extent to which the Chinese fully understood the Indian religio-philosophical system and its relationship to the indigenous Daoist and Confucian traditions.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
    1. Traditional Biography
    2. Other Accounts
  2. Works
  3. Background
    1. Indian Mdhyamika
    2. Chinese Mdhyamika
  4. The Treatises
    1. Overview
    2. Things Do Not Shift
    3. Non Absolute Emptiness
    4. Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge
    5. Correspondence with Liu Yimin
    6. Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization
    7. The Treatises as a Whole
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

a. Traditional Biography

The Gaoseng Zhuan (Biographies of Eminent Monks), contains the following traditional account of Sengzhao’s life: The monk Sengzhao was a man from Jingzhao. His family being impoverished, Zhao hired himself out as a copyist in order to make a living. As such, he successively went through the Classics and History, in the process becoming proficient in writing. Zhao's interests inclined towards the subtle and profound, having always considered Lao[zi] and Zhuang[zi] as particularly important in terms of the mind. After studying Laozi’s Daodejing, Zhao declared, “It is indeed beautiful, but I have not yet discovered the region where my spirit can settle down and my worldly ties be completely severed.” After a time, Zhao read the old [version] of the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra and was overcome with happiness and pleasure. Opening it repeatedly, he relished its flavor and exclaimed, “At last I know where I should be!” Because of this, Zhao became a learned monk, studying both the Vaipulya Stra and the Tripitaka.

Having reached the age for capping [coming of age], Zhao’s reputation had become widespread through the Passes and in the administrative capital. In time, however, quarrelsome people doubted the fame that had come to him primarily because of his youth. Coming from as far away as one thousand li, they entered the Passes and engaged Zhao in debate. However, since Zhao had a talent for profound thinking and was also an expert in pure conversation, he seized whatever openings he had and pointedly crushed his opponents, who could not obstruct him. In time, respected scholars from Jingzhao and from outside the Passes wondered at his discriminating arguments and considered trying to challenge him.

At the time when Kumrajva [a famous Central Asian Buddhist missionary to China, c. 344-413 CE] arrived in Gecang, Zhao followed him in order to become a disciple. Kumrajva highly praised him without limit. When Kumrajva moved to Chang’an, Zhao also followed him there. Yao Xing placed Zhao, Sengrui and other monks in the Xiaoyao pavilion, where they assisted in the examination and editing of the Buddhist treatises.

Zhao, being aware that the Sage [the Buddha] had passed on long ago, that the literature had come to take on numerous mixed interpretations, and that earlier translations of the texts had certain mistakes in them, regularly consulted with Kumrajva and greatly increased his comprehension. Therefore, following the translation of the Pancavimshatisahsrik prajnpramit Stra (Twenty-Five Thousand Stanza Perfection of Wisdom Stra), Zhao wrote the treatise entitled Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge in over two thousand words. Upon its completion, Zhao presented it to Kumrajva. After reading it, the master declared it to be beautiful and said to Zhao, “My explanations are on par with yours, but your wording and expression is far better!”

In time, the retired Lushan scholar Liu Yimin saw a copy of Zhao's Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge. He also praised it, saying, “I did not think that among your monks there would be another Bingshu.” In turn, Liu Yimin presented it to his superior, Huiyuan, who also cherished it. Huiyuan exclaimed that he had never seen another like it. Accordingly, the entire community opened and savored the treatise, passing it from one to another repeatedly.

Liu Yimin also composed a letter to Zhao.  Following this, Zhao wrote treatises on Non Absolute Emptiness, Things Do Not Shift and others. In addition, he commented on the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra and composed numerous prefaces, all of which remain extant. Following the death of Kumrajva, Zhao reflected on his teacher’s untimely death and eternal departure, feeling his longing desires and hopes vanquished. At this time, Zhao wrote the treatise Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization.  This essay consists of ten explanations and nine arguments in approximately one thousand words. When the treatise was completed, Zhao presented it to his superior, Yao Xing….

Yao Xing's response to Zhao’s work was very attentive to various details about the meaning and included praise for its completeness. He then ordered by decree that it be copied and distributed to all the members of his family. This action demonstrates how highly Zhao was regarded at this time. In the tenth year of the yixi period [c. 413-414 CE], Zhao died in Chang’an, having reached the autumn of his thirty first year. (Taishô shinsh daizokyô L; No. 2509; 365a-366b.1)

b. Other Accounts

A number of other accounts exist concerning the life of Sengzhao, though they rarely shed any new light on his work or activities. The Weishou [a collection of canonical texts] accords Sengzhao preeminence among the eight hundred or so scholars gathered at Chang’an: “Daorong and his fellows were of knowledge and learning all-pervasive, and Sengzhao was the greatest of them. When Kumrajva made a translation, Sengzhao would always take pen in hand and define the meanings of words. He annotated the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra and also published several treatises. They all have subtle meaning, and scholars venerate them.” (Hurvitz 54)

While adding nothing substantively new, this version highlights Sengzhao's importance as a liaison between the Indian Kumrajva and the Chinese language. All indications point to the foreign master's reliance on Sengzhao's ability to “translate” the Indian terminology into stylistically acceptable Chinese. The gong’an (meditation puzzle) collection known as the Biyen lu (Blue Cliff Records) contains a tale concerning Sengzhao's death which by all accounts is apocryphal. Despite its spurious legend regarding Zhao's demise, within the gongan commentary supplied by the Chan (“meditation”; Japanese Zen) master Yunmen, we find another reference to his life that provides some insight into his correspondence with Liu Yimin. According to the Biyen lu, Sengzhao not only took Kumrajva as his teacher, but “he also called upon the bodhisattva Buddhabhadra at the Temple of the Tile Coffin, who had come from India to transmit the mind-seal of the twenty-seventh Patriarch. Sengzhao then entered deeply into the inner sanctum.” (Cleary and Cleary 1977:401)

2. Works

In terms of literary output, Sengzhao's major extant work is the Zhaolun. This text is a product of the formative years of the Chinese Mdhyamika tradition, and consists of a preface, introduction, four treatises and a set of correspondence between Sengzhao and Liu Yimin, a lay monk from the nearby Lushan monastery. The Zhaolun represents one of the earliest and most comprehensive examples of the embryonic thought of the Chinese Mdhyamika school.

In fact, it may be the only extensive compilation of early Chinese Mdhyamika treatises available. Not only do we possess most of the works ascribed to Sengzhao, but the extant texts are full-length, internally logical discourses. By comparing the preface, internal evidence and Sengzhao's biography, the following order of composition emerges:

c. 405: Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge
c. 409: Non-Absolute Emptiness
c. 410: Correspondence with Liu Yimin
c. 410-411: Things Do Not Shift
c. 412-413: Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization
c. 412-413: Introduction (if genuinely composed by Sengzhao, as tradition asserts)

In its completed form, as found in the Taishô shinsh daizokyô (Taishô XLV, No. 1858), the text is rearranged into the following order:

Things Do Not Shift
Non-Absolute Emptiness
Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge
Correspondence with Liu Yimin

Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization

In addition, Sengzhao is credited with a commentary on the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra, an obituary of Kumrajva, an afterword to the Saddharmapundrika Stra, and prefaces to four Mahyna texts: the Drghgama, the Shata Shstra, the Brahmajla Stra, and the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra.

The Chan tradition also attributes another treatise to the hand of Sengzhao, the Baozang lun (Treasure Store Treatise) (Taishô XLV, No. 1857: 143b-150a), though most scholars regard the work as spurious. Another work, entitled On the Identity of the Buddha's Two Bodies, has been attributed to Sengzhao; this essay, however, is lost and no corroborating evidence of its existence can be found, either in Sengzhao's other work or that of later commentators.

In his writing, Sengzhao routinely employs the standard tools of Mdhyamika discourse (see Ngrjuna). Thus, we find Sengzhao engaging in dialectical arguments in which he resorts to the tetralemma (four-cornered negation) as a “solution.” According to this formula, any proposition x entails four logical possibilities:

  1. X is
  2. X is not
  3. X both is and is not
  4. X neither is nor is not

Two of his treatises (Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge and Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization) follow the debate-like format of Ngrjuna’s Mulamadhyamakakrik (Verses on the Fundamentals of the Middle Way) [MMK]. In addition, Sengzhao became famous for his artful use of paradox, often reminiscent of the Daoist classic, Zhuangzi. This stylistic trait would make him a favorite of the later Chan school, which regarded Sengzhao as one of its unofficial patriarchs.

3. Background

a. Indian Mdhyamika

Mdhyamika, a philosophical development that arose within Mahyna Buddhism during the first few centuries CE, concentrates on breaking down the reliance on ordinary means of apprehending the world around us. While concepts and ideas are a necessary part of functioning within the world of conventional reality, our tendency to substantialize those concepts into metaphysical realities leads to behavior generating the basic problems of dis-ease (duhkha) and therefore becoming.

Indian Mdhyamika targets the mind’s natural disposition toward conceptualization, a tendency that both creates and fosters a false sense of duality ensuing between the perceiving subject and observed objects. By assigning distinctive names and characteristics to things, we unwittingly create a false dichotomy, particularly in terms of linguistic conventions. Ngrjuna (c. 150-250 CE) referred to this process as the proliferation of conceptual and verbal hair-splitting, or prapanca. He articulated the concept of “emptiness” (shnyat) – the view that neither subject nor object exist independently -- as a soteriological device, a deconstructive tool to rid the mind of delusional prapanca. Defined in varying ways by Western scholars, prapanca refers to the mind’s natural tendency to both create elaborate networks of interrelated mental constructions and to cling to those constructs as real.

One who grasps the view that the Tathgata exists,
Having seized the Buddha,
Constructs conceptual fabrications [prapanca]
About one who has achieved nirvna.

Those who develop mental fabrications with regard to the Buddha,
Who has gone beyond all fabrications,
As a consequence of those cognitive fabrications,
Fail to see the Tathgata. (Garfield 1995:62)

These mental fabrications inevitably arise from the mind’s predilection for naming things. In trying to distinguish between things and their respective functions, we assign names as a means of identification. The process of naming itself involves the picking out of abstracted characteristics unique to an entity and declaring it to be the “essence” of the thing.

What human beings perceive as reality is nothing more than artificially manufactured distinctions between things which in turn re-combine into a sense of “I” and “it/them.” From the practical standpoint of everyday living and functioning within the confines of the mundane, these constructs are absolutely necessary. As conventional designations, however, their provisional descriptions have no bearing whatsoever on Ultimate Reality. When taken for the real, they become objects of clinging and therefore fuel for rebirth. Clinging to these fabrications both fuels the cycle of becoming and gives rise to quarrels and disputations.

Common people take their stand on their own points of view . . . and hence there arise all the contentions. Prapanca is the root of all contentions and prapanca arises from the mind. (Dazhi Dulun; Taishô XXV, No. 1509; 61a)

Dissensions abound as a result of the mind’s constant pursuit of what it mistakes for the real. Clinging to the ephemeral, the mind generates ignorance, following its own fantasies in contempt for the way things truly are.

As Ngrjuna goes to great pains to point out, his opponents and the common person continually misinterpret emptiness. One takes it to mean complete annihilationism while another understands it in a newly reified manner. In addressing his opponents’ contention that his emptiness leads to the utter destruction of the Buddhist doctrines of co-dependent origination, karma, the four noble truths and all conventional activity, Ngrjuna retorts:

You understand neither emptiness nor the reasons behind emptiness nor the meaning of emptiness. Therefore you create these problems for yourself. (MMK 24.7)

In his later commentary, Candrakrti (c. 600s CE) elaborates on this verse by connecting the opponents’ position to a misapprehension of the entire Mdhyamika program. Mdhyamika does not advocate a nihilistic position as alleged, nor does it take on ontological status within Ngrjuna’s philosophy. Rather, the purport of emptiness lies in its capacity as a soteriological device intended to calm the excesses of prapanca.

Emptiness is taught in order to calm conceptual diffusion completely; therefore, its purpose is the calming of all conceptual diffusion [prapanca]. (Huntington 1989:205)

Having pacified conceptualization and destroyed the proliferation of mental constructs, a state of equanimity is reached. No longer drawing artificial distinctions between things, no longer reifying the conventional, the one who grasps the real meaning of emptiness ceases apprehending mistaken perceptions of the self, and thereby realizes the ultimate soteriological goal of release.

When views of “I”and “mine” are extinguished, whether with respect to the inner or outer, the appropriator ceases. This having ceased, arising comes to an end.Activity and dis-ease having come to an end, there is nirvna. Activity and dis-ease arise out of conceptualization. Conceptualization arises out of conceptual hair-splitting [prapanca]. Conceptual hair-splitting ceases through emptiness. (MMK XVIII. 4-5)

b. Chinese Mdhyamika

Although Mdhyamika is known in Chinese as the Sanlun Zong (Three Treatise School), most scholars acknowledge that no such “school” existed until Jizang (549-623), who projected such a lineage back to the time of Sengzhao and the disciples of Kumrajva. The Sanlun Zong derives its name from its identification of three major texts as the focal point of study: the Zhonglun (Verses on the Fundamentals of the Middle Way) and Shi’er Menlun (Twelve Topic Treatise) by Ngrjuna (c. 150-250), and the Bailun (Hundred Treatises) by Aryadeva. In addition to these primary texts, the Chinese Mdhyamika concentrated on a number of secondary texts, as evidenced by the commentaries and prefaces to other Mahayanist texts, including the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra, Bodhisattva dhyna and the Brahmajla Stra.

Chinese Mdhyamika emphasizes the ontological, epistemological and soteriological qualities of emptiness. From this perspective, the main problem facing the unenlightened revolves around their reliance on conceptualization or naming for their understanding and apprehension of the world. In discussing false views concerning the nature of nirvna, Sengzhao points out that “the way of nirvna cannot be understood by grasping at either existence or nonexistence…. These seemingly objective mental projections of existence and nonexistence are merely regions of vain hope.”

Sengzhao elaborates on this point using the concept of “the emptiness of emptiness” (shnyatshnyat) in his Commentary to the Vimalakrtinirdesha Stra:

Those things which are find their genesis in the mind; [those things] which originate in the mind arise from things. That region of affirmation and negation is a place of illusion. (Taishô XXXVIII, NO. 1775; 372c.17-26)

Thus, neither object nor subject exist independently. Mind depends upon the conventionally real and the conventionally real in turn depends upon the mind.

4. The Treatises

a. Overview

Each treatise begins with a basic statement of the problem as understood by Sengzhao. In every instance, the fallacious interpretation of either an object or doctrinal position is immediately linked to the discriminatory activity of prapanca. Understood both in the sense of verbal argumentation and conceptual hair-splitting, prapanca plays a critical role in Sengzhao’s philosophy of religion. While rarely addressing the issue of prapanca directly, he alludes to the question throughout the treatises. Bringing these activities to an end represents the heart of not only the individual treatises but also the text taken as a whole.

Sengzhao traces the genesis of mistaken apprehensions to the interplay and co-dependency of words, concepts and existent things. One without the others proves untenable. Built upon the matrix of observing the phenomenal world (whose mundane existence is never questioned by Sengzhao), ordinary perception functions by assigning a name to individual manifestations and then conceptualizing the conjunction of that name and phenomenon into a self-existent entity with distinctive own-marks. Once the concept has been created and an appropriate name assigned, knowledge of that object is generated. With the presumed knowledge of the thing in hand, the unenlightened believe that they have grasped reality and therefore attained soteriological release.

Sengzhao relentlessly undermines the conventional practice of naming and conceptualizing, believing that the process lead to the delusions and contentions plaguing his day. While never concerned with language as such, he at the same time recognizes the fact that the continuous inter-generational usage of words establishes a common perception that the things so named and discussed possess discrete own-being. Sengzhao certainly does not believe that from the standpoint of the ordinary person this is a well-thought-out “philosophical” system. On the contrary, he continually bemoans the fact that most people simply do not take the time to reflect upon their everyday assumptions.

By opposing the worldly [perception], our words appear insipid and flavorless, which then prevents the common person from deciding between either accepting or rejecting [the correct perspective]. The inferior person simply washes their hands of it and forgets about these matters. . . . It is indeed grievous to me that people’s affections have been led astray for so long, that the truth lies in front of them and yet they remain unaware of its existence. (Things Do Not Shift)

Truth is under our feet, in front of our eyes and yet we lack either the ability or will to apprehend reality. While displaying a sense of compassion for the ordinary person, Sengzhao at the same time roundly criticizes those who argue and dispute over the nature of reality. Those philosophers and religious practitioners who embark on the spiritual journey but get waylaid by mind games and conceptual elaboration are held accountable for their misapprehensions. Sengzhao immediately takes the contentious, the quarrelsome and the polemical to task in the introductory remarks of each treatise. This practice serves as one indication of his primary objective in dismantling the propagation of conceptual and verbal hair-splitting.

b. Things Do Not Shift

Accordingly, the first treatise begins with Sengzhao’s characterization of the commonplace perception of reality. Life, death, the seasons and all things seemingly rotate and change position in a continuous round of movement. In actual fact, however, no motion exists because the concept of motion presupposes a separation and distinction between things which does not ultimately obtain. Motion and its presumed opposite, rest, are nothing more than one and the same thing from the perspective of absolute truth (paramrthasatya).

Those who remain deceived, however, cannot comprehend their concurrence, giving rise to “quarrels and the drawing of distinctions. [Thus], the ancient pathways are overrun by lovers of difference.” The multiplication of conceptual distinctions and the resulting attachments to those differences generate a multitude of arguments among the unenlightened, hopelessly complicating the apprehension of the truth. If we neglect presenting the correct perspective, we merely “allow deceptive views about the nature of things to arise and then are unable to recover [the truth].” Sengzhao clearly has prapanca in mind when he criticized the lovers of difference, even though he never explicitly mentions it by name.

c. Non Absolute Emptiness

Similarly, Non-Absolute Emptiness begins with an eloquent description of the relationship between the enlightened sage’s wisdom and emptiness Apprehending the truth concerning the nature of emptiness, the sage engages the world while at the same time remaining unattached to its snares. Through his enlightened mind, he comprehends the absolute unity of all things in their suchness and deals with them accordingly. By way of contrast, the masses cannot possibly penetrate to the truth due to their reliance on ordinary understanding. As a result, numerous arguments arose concerning the nature of emptiness.

Conversations today all end up disagreeing when they arrive at the fundamentals of emptiness. Because they insist on disagreeing in order to come to some type of agreement, how will they ever settle anything? Hence, in their public quarrels they are unable to arrive at an understanding.

After describing three such misinterpretations of emptiness, Sengzhao underscores his contention that delusion arises through the compounding of things and names. Talk has done nothing but lead the masses to misapprehension and confusion, diverting them from the truth concerning the actual nature of things. Sengzhao therefore alludes to the co-dependent relationship between phenomenal things, naming, thought and reification.

A thing is a thing with reference to things, and so you might call it a thing; however, a thing which is a thing with reference to things is not [truly] a thing, even though we call it [a thing]. Hence, things are not identical with their names, which [do not] complete the thing's actuality; names are not identical with the thing and are therefore incapable of leading one to the Ultimate.

The correct apprehension of the true nature of things lies completely outside of the morass of words and conceptualizations. Again, Sengzhao is not taking an anti-linguistic stance as such; he does not argue that language constitutes the root of all evil. However, he recognizes that we form our perceptions of the world based on the mind’s tendency to discriminate, distinguish and assign names to things presumed to possess own-being. His acknowledgement of language’s relative importance is reflected in the fact that despite its problems, he “cannot remain silent . . . [and f]or the time being . . . will utilize words . . . [in an attempt] to elucidate” the meaning of emptiness.

In the end, false conceptualizations are done away with and the arbitrariness of names established. Similes and metaphors function only to dislodge the mind from its discriminatory activity. For this reason, the sage engages the world of the phenomenal while remaining detached and identifies with the essential unity of the ultimate and mundane.

d. Prajn Is Without Dichotomizing Knowledge

Prajn (wisdom) is likewise undifferentiated from the One True Ultimate. With correct perception, the emptiness and subtlety of enlightened wisdom represents the culmination of all three vehicles. In ultimacy, neither distinction nor contradiction exists between the paths. Once again, however, “contentious arguments have recently led to confusion and differentiated theories” over the nature of prajn. The proliferation of prapanca has generated speculation that wisdom operates through discriminatory and dichotomizing knowledge. Therefore, Sengzhao feels compelled to dispel the falsehoods and illuminate the correct viewpoint.

After an introductory survey chronicling prajn’s arrival in China, the third treatise opens its substantive argument by depicting sagely wisdom as “subtle, its mysteries profound and [infinite depths] difficult to plumb. Markless and without conceptualization, it cannot be apprehended through either words or symbols.” In attempting to define it or use words to illustrate its nature, we inevitably dissect and create differentiations in regard to the sage’s mind and its functioning. Nevertheless, Sengzhao once again feels that he has no choice but to use words in discussing the matter.

e. Correspondence with Liu Yimin

Unfortunately, having committed description to the inadequacies of language, difficulties and new contentions arise when Sengzhao’s treatise arrives at Lushan. In his correspondence with Sengzhao, Liu Yimin, following his salutary remarks, acknowledges that while erudite, Sengzhao’s consignment of insight to the vagaries of language has produced disagreement and contention within the assembly.

To resign such a subtle principle to mere words is indeed dangerous; those who sing out in this manner find few who can comprehend. Those who cannot cut themselves off from clinging to manifested words and symbols will not grasp the meaning . . . [therefore] I wish to tell you of the doubts which your lofty treatise has raised in those seeking out differences in the mind of the sage.

Sengzhao responds by chastising Liu Yimin and his fellows for fixating on the mere form of words. Looking to the finger as though it were the moon, the scholar-monks at Lushan have equated the discriminative nature of concepts and words with the non-dual functioning of the sage’s mind:

Those participating in the discussions have become fixated on mere words. “In your investigation of the great space you search out the corners.” True understanding again lies outside the parameters of speech and conceptualization. You true gentlemen trained in the profound should know this teaching and understand.

One should abandon the search for the mere traces of truth and embrace the meaning behind the words. “Once one sets his mind to think about it, he begins to err; even more so if one attempts to use words.” Sengzhao advises the learned monks to desist from their reliance on the mundane perspective in favor of the non-dual apprehension of the enlightened.

f. Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization

Finally, in the case of Nirvna is Without Conceptualization, Sengzhao again defends orthodox teachings against those who would constrain the goal of final release to words and concepts. Misunderstanding the basic import of nirvna, the deluded believe it to be a substantive state, one to which they can attain while escaping the phenomenal world. Subtle and mysterious, the expansive, infinite void is unapproachable by the ordinary modes of sight and hearing, and therefore incomprehensible for the banal multitudes.

While the masses lack the capability to apprehend the nuances of nirvna, the philosophically minded have engaged in fruitless disputations which in the end have turned them against the very truth they sought. Inasmuch as they “care only for the words” describing the indescribable, they are “unable to comprehend superior thinking.” Hence, the purpose behind this treatise was to “silence the heretical discussions concerning that vast space.”

For those tied to words, the “one who does not name/conceptualize” [wu ming] proceeds to disabuse them of their views. As Sengzhao insists at the outset, while nirvna is unnameable and non-conceptual,

it is [nevertheless] spoken of as either having or lacking a remainder. These words surely only refer to the different signs of its emergence and remaining. They are simply false thought constructions applied to their corresponding manifestations.

Unattainable through either words or conceptualizations, nirvna consistently eludes reification. Seeking it by means of the worldly reduces the philosopher to stupidity, the rhetorician to silence and the materialists to despair. Accordingly,

the Buddha practiced silence while at Magadha; Vimalakrti refused to speak at Vaishli; Subhti taught the doctrine of no speech and Sakra, King of the Devas, heard nothing and yet it rained flowers.

Only when understood through the non-conceptualizing, non-grasping and non-discriminatory faculty of perfected wisdom does the soteriological take on its true character.

g. The Treatises as a Whole

Another important key to understanding Sengzhao’s thought lies in recognizing the pattern established between the Treatises and the logic inherent in their arrangement, a logic which ties the separate treatises together into a coherent demonstration of the path toward enlightenment. While never explicitly identified within the text itself, this design effectively discloses the logic of religious illumination and soteriological awakening. In following the development of the text itself, we can approximate Sengzhao’s vision concerning the path to enlightenment.

Through the emptying of emptiness, the text progressively moves the reader along a systematic presentation of the mutual relationships which ensue between the objects of cognition [Things Do Not Shift and Non-Absolute Emptiness], their subject [Prajn Is Without Dichotomous Knowing and The Correspondence with LiuYimin] and the ultimate result of correct perception into the nature of that relationship [Nirvna Is Without Conceptualization].

In following the text’s design, the reader is successively led through four interrelated steps:

  1. The realization that things are devoid of an intrinsic self and therefore empty;
  2. That the emptiness of things is not in itself an absolute to be grasped by the conceptualizing mind, in spite of the fact that it represents the ultimate perspective concerning the nature of all things;
  3. Although without graspable, and therefore obtainable, characteristics, emptiness can nevertheless be realized through the medium of perfect wisdom, representing the subject of a knowledge that goes beyond conceptualization and the subject/object duality;
  4. Inasmuch as wisdom illuminates emptiness, its knowing through non-knowing serves as the effective cause for the illumination of the non-conceptual, unnameable effect of the beginningless and endless nirvna.

As reflected within the text and already noted, Sengzhao and the early Chinese Buddhists recognize that conceptualization represents the principal obstacle facing the unenlightened. Fundamentally tied to the conception of an independently existing self, human beings consistently engage the world from the perspective of the ego, viewing the inner self as subject and all other things as objects. Granting existence to both self and others, we naturally create a disjuncture that results in clinging to some things while simultaneously rejecting others, unavoidably fueling the continued round of becoming. Breaking the cycle, for the Mdhyamika, begins with dislodging the mind’s attachment to logically absurd distinctions and its creation of erroneous oppositional categories such as existent/nonexistent, subject/object, nirvna/samsra.

In the final analysis, Mdhyamika sets out to demonstrate the logical absurdity of the cognitive process’ internal structure and the way it expresses itself verbally. In terms of the twelve links in the chain of becoming:

The root of cyclic existence is action.
Therefore the wise one does not act….
With the cessation of ignorance Action will not arise.
The cessation of ignorance occurs through Meditation and wisdom. (MMK XXVI.10-11)

To bring the proliferation of mental fabrications to an end is to put a stop to self-centered action and the refueling of samsra (the cycle of rebirth and suffering). Therefore, the mind represents the principal obstacle to full enlightenment while simultaneously possessing the greatest potential for attaining final release. Ngrjuna cites the Buddha in defense of his assertion that “the power of mind is greatest. By practicing the perfection of wisdom, [an aspirant] can shatter the great mound into tiny particles. . . . Insofar as the mind possesses none of the four qualities [form, scent, taste and density], its power is the greatest.” (Dazhi dulun 299c.5) Kumrajva likewise points to the mind as the root of human troubles and advocates a transcendence of all discursive thought.

[The Dazhi dulun] says that dissociation from all verbalism and quenching all workings of thought is termed the real-mark of all the dharmas. The real-mark of the dharmas is conventionally termed suchness, dharma-nature, and reality-limit. In this [suchness] even the not-existent-and-not-inexistent cannot be found, much less the existent and the inexistent. It is only because of fantasy-conceptions that each one has difficulties about existence and inexistence. If you will conform to the cessation-mark of the Buddha’s Dharma, then you will have no discursive fictions [prapanca]. If you figment fictions about existence and inexistence, then you depart from the Buddha’s Dharma. (Robinson 1978:184-185)

Sengzhao’s primary concern as a Mdhyamikan, therefore, revolves around the mind’s proclivity for naming and absolutizing. A natural operation of the “knowing” faculty, conceptualization functions through the cause and effect relationship of “knowing” arising as an effect generated by the “known” acting as cause. The known therefore function as the objects of knowledge’s knowing and so long as the objects are considered real or substantive, “knowing” represents the proper avenue for realizing the real. Activity and suffering arise as a result of conceptualization, which itself arises from mental fabrications located within the discriminative mind. Bringing to cessation the activity of the knowing mind represents the starting point for the self-realization of reality.

As Nishitani Keiji describes it, religion itself constitutes the “real self-awareness of reality,” by which he means that

our ability to perceive reality means that reality realizes (actualizes) itself in us; that this in turn is the only way that we can realize (appropriate through understanding) the fact that reality is so realizing itself in us; and that in so doing the self-realization of reality itself takes place. (Nishitani 1982:5)

In the end, Sengzhao and the Zhaolun take the reader full circle. Just as the mundane object of knowledge (things) is inherently empty, so too is the ultimate goal toward which things are striving. Unified in their emptiness, each is completely fulfilled and established in their home-ground. The sage has awakened to the wondrous mystery of self-realization, locating reality right where he stands. By following the design of the unified text, the reader can also attain to the attainable as Sengzhao gradually guides us through a thorough-going analysis of the factors of existence and core teachings of the Mdhyamika school.

Beginning with the establishment of the provisional nature of the myriad things and their inherent emptiness, Sengzhao systematically dismantles delusional conceptions concerning emptiness, wisdom and nirvna. In each case, the reliance on mental fabrications and reification of the inherently empty are shown to be logically inconsistent and therefore wrong-headed views about the nature of things as they truly are. Realizing through the power of wisdom and employment of skillful means that emptiness constitutes the true nature of all things, created as well as uncreated, the aspirant attains to the knowledge that ultimate reality is not an absolute lying outside the bounds of the phenomenal, but rather the absolute within the phenomenal. Immanent and yet inaccessible to the ordinary mind, only prajnpramit can bridge the chasm separating the common person from nirvna. Its use, however, within the context of and following the pattern established by the Zhaolun, will eventually end with the realization that

the one who follows after the Genuine becomes the same as the Genuine, while those who go after illusion become the same as illusion . . . [and] liberation exists in the midst of non-liberation.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Chang, Chung-yuan. "Nirvna is Nameless." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 1 (1974): 247-274.
  • Cheng, Hsueh-li. "Zen and San-lun Mdhyamika Thought: Exploring the Theoretical Foundation of Zen Teachings and Practices." Religious Studies 15 (1979): 343-363.
  • Cheng, Hsueh-li. "Motion and Rest in the Middle Treatises." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 7 (1980): 229-244.
  • Cheng, Hsueh-li. "Truth and Logic in San-lun Mdhyamika Buddhism." International Philosophical Quarterly 21 (1981): 261-276.
  • Cheng, Hsueh-li. Empty Logic: Mdhyamika Buddhism from Chinese Sources. New York: Philosophical Library, 1984; reprint ed., Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1991.
  • Cleary, Thomas, and J.C. Cleary, trans. The Blue Cliff Records. Boulder, CO: Shambala, 1978.
  • Garfield, Jay L., trans. The Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way: Ngrjuna’s Mulamadhyamakakrik. New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Huntington, C. W. The Emptiness of Emptiness: An Introduction to Early Indian Mdhyamika. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1989.
  • Hurvitz, Leon, trans. “Wei Shou, Treatise on Buddhism and Taoism.” In Yun-kang: The Buddhist Cave Temples of the Fifth Centruy A.D. in North China, Vol. 16 (supplement), 25-103. Kyoto: Kyoto University, Institute of Humanistic Studies, 1956.
  • Ichimura, Shohei. "A Study on the Mdhyamika Method of Refutation and its Influence on Buddhist Logic." Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies 4.1 (1981): 87-95.
  • Ichimura, Shohei. "A Determining Factor that Differentiated Indian and Chinese Mdhyamika Methods of Dialectic as Reductio-ad-absurdum and Paradoxical Argument Respectively." Journal of Indian and Buddhist Studies 33 (March, 1985): 841-834.
  • Ichimura, Shohei. "On the Dialectical Meaning of Instantiation in terms of Maya-Drstanta in the Indian and Chinese Mdhyamikas." Journal of Indian and Buddhist Studies 36.2 (March, 1988): 977-971.
  • Ichimura, Shohei. "On the Paradoxical Method of the Chinese Mdhyamika: Seng-chao and the Chao-lun Treatise." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 19 (1992): 51-71.
  • Liebenthal, Walter. The Chao Lun: The Treatises of Seng-Chao. 2nd rev. ed. Hong Kong: Hong Kong University Press, 1968.
  • Liu, Ming-wood. "Seng-chao and the Mdhyamika Way of Refutation." Journal of Chinese Philosophy 14 (1987): 97-110.
  • Liu, Ming-wood. Mdhyamaka Thought in China. Sinica Leidensia, Vol. XXX. Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1994.
  • Nishitani, Keiji. Religion and Nothingness. Trans. Jan Van Bragt. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1982.
  • Robinson, Richard H. "Mysticism and Logic in Seng-chao's Thought." Philosophy East and West 8.3-4 (1958-1959): 99-120.
  • Robinson, Richard H. Early Mdhyamika in India and China. New York: Samuel Weiser, 1965; reprint ed., Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1978.
  • Sharf, Robert. Coming to Terms with Chinese Buddhism: A Reading of the Treasure Store Treatise. Honolulu: University of Hawaii, 2001.
  • Tsukamoto Zenry. A History of Early Chinese Buddhism: From Its Introduction to the Death of Hui-yüan. 2 vols. Trans. Leon Hurvitz. Tokyo, New York, San Francisco: Kodansha International, 1985.

Author Information

Jeffrey Dippmann
Central Washington University
U. S. A.

Theophrastus (c. 371—c. 287 B.C.E.)

TheophrastusTheophrastus was a Greek philosopher of the Peripatetic school, and immediate successor of Aristotle in leadership of the Lyceum. He was a native of Eresus in Lesbos, and studied philosophy at Athens, first under Plato and afterwards under Aristotle. He became the favorite pupil of Aristotle, who named Theophrastus his successor, and bequeathed to him his library and manuscripts of his own writings. Theophrastus sustained the Aristotelian character of the Lyceum. He is said to have had 2,000 disciples, among them the comic poet Menander. He was esteemed by the kings Philippus, Cassander, and Ptolemy. He was tried for impiety, but acquitted by the Athenian jury. He died in 287 BCE, having presided over the Lyceum about thirty-five years. His age is sometimes put at 85, and 107 by others. He is said to have closed his life with the complaint about the short duration of human life, that it ended just when the insight into its problems was beginning.

Although Theophrastus generally followed Aristotle's lead in philosophy, he was no mere slavish imitator, and he continued important empirical and philosophical investigations of his own. Very little of his work survives, but he seems in general to have emphasized the empiricist side of Aristotle's thought and downplayed remaining Platonist elements, a trend that was further continued by Theophrastus' successor as head of the Lyceum, Strato. Theophrastus criticized some of Aristotle's arguments for the existence of a Prime Mover, and he expressed dissatisfaction with Aristotle's universal application of teleological (that is, goal-directed) explanations. Theophrastus also composed a large compendium of the doctrines of previous philosophers, which itself is lost, but which probably formed the basis for much of the later doxography which is our main source of information on the pre-Socratic philosophers.

Author Information

The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Timon (fl. 279 B.C.E.)

TimonTimon was a disciple of Pyrrho and philosopher of the sect of the Skeptics, who flourished in the reign of Ptolemy Philadelphus, about 279 BCE. and onwards. The son of Timarchus of Phlius, Timon first studied philosophy at Megara, under Stilpo, and then returned home and married. He next went to Elis with his wife, and heard Pyrrho, whose tenets he adopted. Driven from Elis by straitened circumstances, he spent some time on the Hellespont and the Propontis, and taught at Chalcedon as a sophist with such success that he acquired a fortune. He then moved to Athens, where he passed the remainder of his life, with the exception of a short residence at Thebes. He died at the age of almost ninety. Timon appears to have had an active mind, and with a quick perception of the follies of people which betrays its possessor into a spirit of universal distrust both of men and truths, so as to make him a skeptic in philosophy and a satirist in everything. His agnosticism (to use a modern term) is shown by his saying that people need only know three things -- namely, what is the nature of things, how we are related to them, and what we can gain from them. But as our knowledge of things must always be subjective and unreal, we can only live in a state of suspended judgment. He wrote numerous works both in prose and poetry. The most celebrated of his poems were the satiric compositions called silli, a word of somewhat doubtful etymology, but which undoubtedly describes metrical compositions of a character at once ludicrous and sarcastic. The invention of this species of poetry is ascribed to Xenophones of Colophon. The Silli of Timon were in three books, in the first of which he spoke in his own person, and the other two are in the form of a dialogue between the author and Xenophanes of Colophon, in which Timon proposed questions to which Xenophanes replied at length. The subject was a sarcastic account of the tenets of all philosophers, living and dead -- an unbounded field for skepticism and satire. They were in hexameter verse, and from the way in which they are mentioned by the ancient writers, as well as from the few fragments of them which have come down to us, it is evident that they were admirable productions. (Diog. Laert. ix. 12, 109-155; Euseb. Praep. Ev. xiv. p. 761).

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The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.

Nasir al-Din Tusi (1201—1274)

Nasir al-Din Tusi, by far the most celebrated scholar of the 13th century Islamic lands, was born in Tus, in 1201 and died in Baghdad in 1274. He was apparently born into a Twelver Shi‘i family. At the age of twenty-two or a while later, Tusi joined the court of Nasir al-Din Muhtashim, the Ismaili governor of Quhistan, Northeast Iran, where he was accepted into the Ismaili community as a novice.Around 634/1236, we find Tusi in Alamut, the centre of Nizari Ismaili government. He seems to have climbed the ranks of the Ismaili da‘wat ascending to the position of chief missionary (da‘i al-du‘at). The collapse of Ismaili political power and the massacre of the Ismaili population, during the Mongol invasion, left no choice for Tusi except the exhibition of some sort of affiliation to Twelver Shi‘ism and denouncing his Ismaili allegiances (taqiyya).

In the Mongol court, Tusi witnessed the fall of the ‘Abbasid caliphate and after a while, securing the trust of Hulegu, the Mongol chief, he was given the full authority of administering the finances of religious foundations (awqaf). The ensemble of Tusi’s writings amounts to approximately 165 titles on a wide variety of subjects (astronomy, ethics, history, jurisprudence, logic, mathematics, medicine, philosophy, theology, poetry and the popular sciences).

Nasir al-Din Tusi, Muhammad b. Muhammad b. Hasan, by far the most celebrated scholar of the 7th/13th century Islamic lands was born in Tus, in 597/1201 and died in Baghdad on 18 Dhu’l Hijja 672/25 June, 1274. Thomas Aquinas and Roger Bacon were his contemporaries in the West. Very little is known about his childhood and early education, apart from what he writes in his autobiography, Contemplation and Action (Sayr wa suluk).

He was apparently born into a Twelver Shi‘i family and lost his father at a young age. Fulfilling the wish of his father, the young Muhammad took learning and scholarship very seriously and travelled far and wide to attend the lectures of renowned scholars and ‘acquire the knowledge which guides people to the happiness of the next world.’ As a young boy, Tusi studied mathematics with Kamal al-Diin Hasib about whom we have no authentic knowledge. In Nishabur he met Farid al-Din ‘Attar, the legendary Sufi master who was later killed in the hand of Mongol invaders and attended the lectures of Qutb al-Din Misri and Farid al-Din Damad. In Mawsil he studied mathematics and astronomy with Kamal al-Din Yunus (d. 639/1242). Later on he corresponded with Qaysari, the son-in-law of Ibn al-‘Arabi, and it seems that mysticism, as propagated by Sufi masters of his time, was not appealing to his mind and once the occasion was suitable, he composed his own manual of philosophical Sufism in the form of a small booklet entitled The Attributes of the Illustrious (Awsaf al-ashraf).

His ability and talent in learning enabled Tusi to master a number disciplines in a relatively short period. At the time when educational priorities leaned towards the religious sciences, especially in his own family who were associated with the Twelver Shi‘i clergy, Tusi seems to have shown great interest for mathematics, astronomy and the intellectual sciences. At the age of twenty-two or a while later, Tusi joined the court of Nasir al-Din Muhtashim, the Ismaili governor of Quhistan, Northeast Iran, where he was accepted into the Ismaili community as a novice (mustajib). A sign of close personal relationship with Muhtashim’s family is to be seen in the dedication of a number of his scholarly works such as Akhlaq-i Nasiri and Akhlaq-i Muhtashimi to Nasir al-Din himself and Risala-yi Mu‘iniyya to his son Mu‘in al-Din.

Around 634/1236, we find Tusi in Alamut, the centre of Nizari Ismaili government. The scholarly achievements of Tusi in the compilation of Akhlaq-i Nasiri in 633/1235, seems to, amongst other factors, have paved the way for this move which was a great honour and opportunity for a scholar of his calibre, especially since Alamut was the seat of the Ismaili imam and housed the most important library in the Ismaili state.

In Alamut, apart from teaching, editing, dictating and compiling scholarly works, Tusi seems to have climbed the ranks of the Ismaili da‘wat ascending to the position of chief missionary (da‘i al-du‘at). Through constant visits with scholars and tireless correspondences, a practice which he developed from a very young age, Tusi kept his contact with the academic world outside Ismaili circles and was addressed as ‘the scholar’ (al-muhaqiq) from a very early period in his life.

The Mongol invasion and the turmoil they caused in the eastern Islamic territories hardly left the life of any of its citizens untouched. The collapse of Ismaili political power and the massacre of the Ismaili population, who were a serious threat to the Mongols, left no choice for Tusi except the exhibition of some sort of affiliation to Twelver Shi‘ism and denouncing his Ismaili allegiances.

Although under Mongol domination, Tusi’s allegiance to any particular community or persuasion could not have been of any particular importance, the process itself paved the ground for Tusi to write on various aspects of Shi‘ism, both from Ismaili and Twelver Shi‘i viewpoints, with scholarly vigour and enthusiasm. The most famous of his Ismaili compilations are Rawda-yi taslim, Sayr wa suluk, Tawalla wa tabarra, Akhlaq-i Muhtashimi and Matlub al-mu’minin. Tajrid al-i‘tiqad, al-Risala fi’l-imama and Fusul-i Nasiriyya are among his works dedicated to Twelver Shi‘ism.

In the Mongol court, Tusi witnessed the fall of the ‘Abbasid caliphate and after a while, securing the trust of Hulegu, the Mongol chief, he was given the full authority of administering the finances of religious foundations (awqaf). During this period of his life, Tusi’s main concern was combating Mongol savagery, saving the life of innocent scholars and the establishment of one of the most important centres of learning in Maragha, Northwest Iran. The compilation of Musari‘at al-musari;, the Awsaf al-ashraf and Talkis al-muhassal are the scholarly writings of Tusi in the final years of his life.

The ensemble of Tusi’s writings amounts to approximately 165 titles on a wide variety of subjects. Some of them are simply a page or even half a page, but the majority with few exceptions, are well prepared scholarly works on astronomy, ethics, history, jurisprudence, logic, mathematics, medicine, philosophy, theology, poetry and the popular sciences. Tusi’s fame in his own lifetime guaranteed the survival of almost all of his scholarly output. The adverse effect of his fame is also the attribution of a number of works which neither match his style nor has the quality of his writings.

Tusi’s major works: (1) Astronomy: al-Tadhkira fi ‘ilm al-hay’a; Zij Ilkhani; Risala-yi Mu‘iniyya and its commentary. (2) Ethics: Gushayish-nama; Akhlaq-i Muhtashami; Akhlaq-i Nasiri, ‘Deliberation 22’ in Rawda-yi taslim and a Persian translation of Ibn Muqaffa‘’s al-Adab al-wajiz. (3) History: Fath-i Baghdad which appears as an appendix to Tarikh-i Jahan-gushay of Juwayni (London, 1912-27), vol. 3, pp. 280-92. (4) Jurisprudence: Jawahir al-fara’id. (5) Logic: Asas al-iqtibas. (6) Mathematics: Revision of Ptolemy’s Almagest; the epistles of Theodosius, Hypsicles, Autolucus, Aristarchus, Archimedes, Menelaus, Thabit b. Qurra and Banu Musa. (7) Medicine: Ta‘liqa bar qunun-i Ibn Sina and his correspondences with Qutb al-Din Shirazi and Katiban Qazwini. (8) Philosophy: refutation of al-Shahrastani in Musara‘at al-musari‘; his commentary on Ibn Sina’s al-Isharat wa’l-tanbihat which took him almost 20 years to complete; his autobiography Sayr wa suluk; Rawda-yi taslim and Tawalla wa tabarra. (9) Theology: Aghaz wa anjam; Risala fi al-imama and Talkhis al-muhassal and (10) Poetry: Mi‘yar al-ash‘ar.

References and Further Reading

  • Badakhchani, S. J. Contemplation and Action: The Spiritual Autobiography of a Muslim Scholar (London, I. B. Tauris in association with The Institute of Ismaili Studies, 1998).
  • Mudarris Radawi, Muhammad. Ahwal wa athar-i Abu Ja‘far Muhammad b. Muhammad b. Hasan al-Tusi. Tehran, Intisharat-i Danishgah-i Tehran, 1345s/1975.
  • Mudarrisi Zanjani, Muhammad. Sargudhasht wa ‘aqa‘id-i falsafi-yi Khwaja Nasir al-Din Tusi. Tehran, Intisharat-i Danishgah-i Tehran, 1363s/1984.
  • Madelung, Wilferd. ‘Nasir al-Din Tusi’s Ethics Between Philosophy, Shi‘ism and Sufism,’ in Ethics in Islam, ed. R. G. Hovannisian, Malibu, CA, 1985, pp. 85-101.

Author Information

S. J. Badakhchani
The Institute of Ismaili Studies
United Kingdom

Zhuangzi (Chuang-Tzu, 369—298 B.C.E.)

zhuangziZhuangzi, or "Master Zhuang" (also known in the Wade-Giles romanization as Chuang-tzu) was, after Laozi, one of the earliest thinkers to contribute to the philosophy that has come to be known as Daojia, or school of the Way. According to traditional dating, he was an almost exact contemporary of the Confucian thinker Mencius, but there appears to have been little to no communication between them.  He is ranked among the greatest of literary and philosophical giants that China has produced.  His style is complex—mythical, poetic, narrative, humorous, indirect, and polysemic.
Zhuangzi espoused a holistic philosophy of life, encouraging disengagement from the artificialities of socialization, and cultivation of our natural “ancestral” potencies and skills, in order to live a simple and natural, but full and flourishing life. He was critical of our ordinary categorizations and evaluations, noting the multiplicity of different modes of understanding between different creatures, cultures, and philosophical schools, and the lack of an independent means of making a comparative evaluation. He advocated a mode of understanding that is not committed to a fixed system, but is fluid and flexible, and that maintains a provisional, pragmatic attitude towards the applicability of these categories and evaluations.
The text through which we know his work was the result of the editing and arrangement of the Jin dynasty thinker and commentator Guo Xiang (Kuo Hsiang, d. 312 CE), who reduced what had been a work in fifty-two chapters to the current edition of thirty-three chapters, excising material that he considered to be spurious.  Zhuangzi's version of Daoist philosophy was highly influential in the reception, interpretation, and transformation of Buddhism in China.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. The Zhuangzi Text
  3. Central Concepts in the "Inner Chapters"
    1. Chapter 1: Xiao Yao You (Wandering Beyond)
    2. Chapter 2: Qi Wu Lun (Discussion on Smoothing Things Out)
    3. Chapter 3: Yang Sheng Zhu (The Principle of Nurturing Life)
    4. Chapter 4: Ren Jian Shi (The Realm of Human Interactions)
    5. Chapter 5: De Chong Fu (Signs of the Flourishing of Potency)
    6. Chapter 6: Da Zong Shi (The Vast Ancestral Teacher)
    7. Chapter 7: Ying Di Wang (Responding to Emperors and Kings)
  4. Key Interpreters of Zhuangzi
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

According to the great Han dynasty historian, Sima Qian, Zhuangzi was born during the Warring States (403-221 BCE), more than a century after the death of Confucius. During this time, the ostensibly ruling house of Zhou had lost its authority, and there was increasing violence between states contending for imperial power. This situation gave birth to the phenomenon known as the baijia, the hundred schools: the flourishing of many schools of thought, each articulating its own conception of a return to a state of harmony. The first and most important of these schools was that of Confucius, who became the chief representative of the Ruists (Confucians), the scholars and propagators of the wisdom and culture of the tradition. Their great rivals were the Mohists, the followers of Mozi ("Master Mo"), who were critical of what they perceived to be the elitism and extravagance of the traditional culture. The recent archaeological discovery at Guo Dian of an early Laozi manuscript suggests that the philosophical movement associated with the Daodejing also began to emerge during this period. Zhuangzi's brand of Daoist philosophy developed within the context defined by these three schools.

Scholars are increasingly beginning to recognize the connection of Daojia with the culture of the state of Chu in the southern part of China around the Yangzi River valley. In recent years, the diversity of regions and cultures in early China has increasingly been acknowledged. Most interest has been directed to the state of Chu, in large part because of the wealth of archaeological evidence that is being unearthed there. According to Sima Qian, Zhuangzi was born in a village called Meng, in the state of Song; according to Lu Deming, the Sui-Tang dynasty scholar, the Pu River in which Zhuangzi was said to have fished was in the state of Chen which, as Wang Guowei points out, had become a territory of Chu. We might say that Zhuangzi was situated in the borderlands between Chu and the central plains—the plains centered around the Yellow River which were the home of the Shang and Zhou cultures. Certainly, as one learns more about the culture of Chu, one senses deep resonances with the aesthetic sensibility of the Daoists, and with Zhuangzi's style in particular. The silks and bronzes of Chu, for example, are rich and vibrant; the patterns and images on fabrics and pottery are fanciful and naturalistic.

If the traditional dating is reliable, then Zhuangzi would have been an exact contemporary of the Ruistthinker Mencius, but there appears to have been little to no communication between them. There are a few remarks in the Zhuangzi that could be alluding to Mencius' philosophy, but there is nothing in Mencius that shows any interest in Zhuangzi. The philosopher Hui Shi, or Huizi ("Master Hui," 380-305 BCE), was a close friend of Zhuangzi, although not a follower of Daojia. There appears to have been a friendly rivalry between the broad and mythic-minded Zhuangzi and the more shortsighted paradox-monger, Huizi. Despite their very deep philosophical distance, and the limitations of Huizi, Zhuangzi expresses great appreciation both for his linguistic abilities and for his friendship. The other "logician," Gongsun Longzi, would also have been a contemporary of Zhuangzi, and although Zhuangzi does not, unfortunately, engage in any direct philosophical discussion with him, one does find an occasional wink in his direction.

2. The Zhuangzi Text

The currently extant text known as the Zhuangzi is the result of the editing and arrangement of the Jin dynasty thinker and commentator Guo Xiang (Kuo Hsiang, d. 312 CE). He reduced what was then a work in fifty-two chapters to the current edition of thirty-three chapters, excising material that he considered to be spurious. His commentary on the text provides an interpretation that has been highly influential over the subsequent centuries.

Guo Xiang divided the thirty-three chapters into three collections, known as the Inner Chapters (Neipian), the Outer Chapters (Waipian), and the Miscellaneous Chapters (Zapian). The Inner Chapters are the first seven chapters and are considered to be the work of Zhuangzi himself. The Outer Chapters are chapters 8 to 22, and the Miscellaneous Chapters are chapters 23 to 33. The Outer and Miscellaneous Chapters can be further subdivided. Much modern research has been devoted to a sub-classification of these chapters according to philosophical school. Kuan Feng made some scholarly breakthroughs early in the twentieth century; A. C. Graham continued his classification in the tradition of Kuan Feng. Harold Roth has also taken up a consideration of this issue and come up with some very interesting results. What follows is a simplified version of the results of the research of Liu Xiaogan.

According to Liu, chapters 17 to 27 and 32 can be considered to be the work of a school of Zhuangzi's followers, what he calls the Shu Zhuang Pai, or the "Transmitter" school. Graham, following Kuan Feng, considers chapters 22 to 27 and 32 not to be coherent chapters, but merely random "ragbag" collections of fragments. Liu considers chapters 8 to 10, chapters 28 to 31, and the first part of chapter 11 to be from a school of Anarchists whose philosophy is closely related to that of Laozi. Graham, again following in the tradition of Kuan Feng, sees these as two separate but related schools: the first he attributes to a writer he calls the "Primitivist," the second he considers to be a school of followers of Yang Zhu. Liu classifies chapters 12 to 16, chapter 33, and the first part of chapter 11 as belonging to the Huang-Lao school. (Graham refers to the supposed author of these chapters as the "Syncretist.") Graham finds the classification of chapter 16 to be problematic.

In the following chart the further to the right the chapters are listed, the further away they are from the central ideas of the Inner Chapters:

The Inner Chapters School of Zhuang Anarchist chapters Huang-Lao school
1. Wandering Beyond 17. Autumn Floods 8. Webbed Toes 11. Let it Be, Leave it Alone
2. Discussion on Smoothing Things Out 18. Utmost Happiness 9. Horse's Hooves 12. Heaven and Earth
3. The Principle of Nurturing Life 19. Mastering Life 10. Rifling Trunks 13. The Way of Heaven
4. In the Human Realm 20. The Mountain Tree 11. Let it Be, Leave it Alone 14. The Turning of Heaven
5. Signs of Abundant Potency 21. Tian Zi Fang 15. Constrained in Will
6. The Vast Ancestral Teacher 22. Knowledge Wandered North (16?. Mending the Inborn Nature) (16?. Mending the Inborn Nature)
7. Responding to Emperors and Kings 23. Geng Sang Chu
24. Xu Wugui 28. Yielding the Throne 33. The World
25. Ze Yang 29. Robber Zhi
26. External Things 30. Discoursing on Swords
27. Imputed Words 31. The Old Fisherman
32. Lie Yukou

3. Central Concepts in the "Inner Chapters"

The following is an account of the central ideas of Zhuangzi, going successively through each of the seven Inner Chapters. This discussion is not confined to the content of the particular chapters, but rather represents a fuller articulation of the inter-relationships of the ideas between the Inner Chapters, and also between these ideas and those expressed in the Outer and Miscellaneous Chapters, where these appear to be relevant.

a. Chapter 1: Xiao Yao You (Wandering Beyond)

The title of the first chapter of the Zhuangzi has also been translated as "Free and Easy Wandering" and "Going Rambling Without a Destination." Both of these reflect the sense of the Daoist who is in spontaneous accord with the natural world, and who has retreated from the anxieties and dangers of social life, in order to live a healthy and peaceful natural life. In modern Mandarin, the word xiaoyao has thus come to mean "free, at ease, leisurely, spontaneous." It conveys the impression of people who have given up the hustle and bustle of worldly existence and have retired to live a leisurely life outside the city, perhaps in the natural setting of the mountains.

But this everyday expression is lacking a deeper significance that is expressed in the classical Chinese phrase: the sense of distance, or going beyond. As with all Zhuangzi's images, this is to be understood metaphorically. The second word, 'yao,' means 'distance' or 'beyond,' and here implies going beyond the boundaries of familiarity. We ordinarily confine ourselves with our social roles, expectations, and values, and with our everyday understandings of things. But this, according to Zhuangzi, is inadequate for a deeper appreciation of the natures of things, and for a more successful mode of interacting with them. We need at the very least to undo preconceptions that prevent us from seeing things and events in new ways; we need to see how we can structure and restructure the boundaries of things. But we can only do so when we ourselves have 'wandered beyond' the boundaries of the familiar. It is only by freeing our imaginations to reconceive ourselves, and our worlds, and the things with which we interact, that we may begin to understand the deeper tendencies of the natural transformations by which we are all affected, and of which we are all constituted. By loosening the bonds of our fixed preconceptions, we bring ourselves closer to an attunement to the potent and productive natural way (dao) of things.

Paying close attention to the textual associations, we see that wandering is associated with the word wu, ordinarily translated 'nothing,' or 'without.' Related associations include: wusuo (no place), wuyou (no ‘something'), and most famously wuwei (no interference). Roger Ames and David Hall have commented extensively on these wu expressions. Most importantly, they are not to be understood as simple negations, but have a much more complex function. The significance of all of these expressions must be traced back to the wu of Laozi: a type of negation that does not simply negate, but places us in a new kind of relation to 'things'—a phenomenological waiting that allows them to manifest, one that acknowledges the space that is the possibility of their coming to presence, one that appreciates the emptiness that is the condition of the possibility of their capacity to function, to be useful (as the hollow inside a house makes it useful for living). The behavior of one who wanders beyond becomes wuwei: sensitive and responsive without fixed preconceptions, without artifice, responding spontaneously in accordance with the unfolding of the inter-developing factors of the environment of which one is an inseparable part.

But it is not just the crossing of horizontal boundaries that is at stake. There is also the vertical distance that is important: one rises to a height from which formerly important distinctions lose what appeared to be their crucial significance. Thus arises the distinction between the great and the small, or the Vast (da) and the petty (xiao). Of this distinction Zhuangzi says that the petty can not come up to the Vast: petty understanding that remains confined and defined by its limitations cannot match Vast understanding, the expansive understanding that wanders beyond. Now, while it is true that the Vast loses sight of distinctions noticed by the petty, it does not follow that they are thereby equalized, as Guo Xiang suggests. For the Vast still embraces the petty in virtue of its very vastness. The petty, precisely in virtue of its smallness, is not able to reciprocate.

Now, the Vast that goes beyond our everyday distinctions also thereby appears to be useless. A soaring imagination may be wild and wonderful, but it is extremely impractical and often altogether useless. Indeed, Huizi, Zhuangzi's friend and philosophical foil, chides him for this very reason. But Zhuangzi expresses disappointment in him: for his inability to sense the use of this kind of uselessness is a kind of blindness of the spirit. The useless has use, only not as seen on the ordinary level of practical affairs. It has a use in the cultivation and nurturing of the 'shen' (spirit), in protecting the ancestral and preserving one's life, so that one can last out one's natural years and live a flourishing life. Now, this notion of a flourishing life is not to be confused with a 'successful' life: Zhuangzi is not impressed by worldly success. A flourishing life may indeed look quite unappealing from a traditional point of view. One may give up social ambition and retire in relative poverty to tend to one's shen and cultivate one's xing (nature, or life potency).

To summarize: When we wander beyond, we leave behind everything we find familiar, and explore the world in all its unfamiliarity. We drop the tools that we have been taught to use to tame the environment, and we allow it to teach us without words. We imitate its spontaneous behavior and we learn to respond immediately without fixed articulations.

b. Chapter 2: Qi Wu Lun (Discussion on Smoothing Things Out)

If the Inner Chapters form the core of the Zhuangzi collection, then the Qi Wu Lun may be thought of as forming the core of the Inner Chapters. It is, at any rate, the most complex and intricate of the chapters of the Zhuangzi, with allusions and allegories, highly condensed arguments, and baffling metaphors juxtaposed without explanation. It appears to be concerned with the deepest and most 'abstract' understanding of ourselves, our lives, our world, our language, and our understanding itself. The most perplexing sections concern language and judgment, and are filled with paradox, sometimes even contradiction. But the contradictions are not easy to dismiss: their context indicates that they have a deep significance. In part, they appear to attempt to express an understanding about the limits of understanding itself, about the limits of language and thought.

This creates a problem for the interpreter, and especially for the translator. How do we deal with the contradictions? The most common solution is to paraphrase them so as to remove the direct contradictoriness, under the presupposition that no sense can be made of a contradiction. The most common way to remove the contradictions is to insert references to points of view. Those translators, such as A. C. Graham, who do this are following the interpretation of the Jin dynasty commentator Guo Xiang, who presents the philosophy as a form of relativism: apparently opposing judgments can harmonized when it is recognized that they are made from different perspectives.

According to Guo Xiang's interpretation, every thing has its place, its own nature (ziran); every thing has its own value that follows from its own nature. So nothing should be judged by values appropriate to the natures of other things. According to Guo Xiang the vast and the small are equal in significance: this is his interpretation of the word qi in the title, "equalization of all viewpoints". Now, such a radical relativism usually has the goal of issuing a fundamental challenge to the status quo, arguing that the established values have no more validity than any of the minority values, no matter how shocking they may seem to us. Thus, its effect is usually one of destabilization of the social structure. Here, however, we see another of the possible consequences of such a position: paradoxically enough, its inherent conservativeness. Guo Xiang's purpose in asserting this radical uniqueness and necessity of each position is conservative in this way. Indeed, it appears to be articulated precisely in response to those who oppose the traditional Ruist values of humanity and rightness (ren and yi) by claiming to have a superior mystical ground from which to judge them to be lacking. Guo Xiang's aim in asserting the equality of every thing, every position, and every function, is to encourage each thing, and each person, to accept its own place in the hierarchical system, to acknowledge its value in the functioning of the whole. In this way, radical relativism actually forestalls the possibility of radical critique altogether!

According to this reading, the Vast perspective of the giant Peng bird is no better than the petty perspectives of the little birds who laugh at it. And indeed, Guo Xiang, draws precisely this conclusion. But there is a problem with taking this reading too seriously, and it is the kind of problem that plagues all forms of radical relativism when one attempts to follow them through consistently. Simply put, Zhuangzi would have to acknowledge that his own position is no better than those he appears to critique. He would have to acknowledge that his Daoist philosophy, indeed even this articulation of relativism, is no improvement over Confucianism after all, and that it is no less short-sighted than the logic-chopping of the Mohists. This, however, is a consequence that Zhuangzi does not recognize. This is surely an indication that the radical relativistic interpretation is clearly a misreading. No intelligent radical relativist could fail to see this most obvious and direct consequence of their position. And the level of Zhuangzi's intelligence clearly is above the ordinary.

Recently, some western interpreters (Lisa Raphals and Paul Kjellberg, for example) have focused their attention on aspects of the text that express affinities with the Hellenistic philosophy of Skepticism. Now, it is important not to confuse this with what in modern philosophy is thought of as a doctrine of skepticism, the most common form of which is the claim that we cannot ever claim to know anything, for at least the reason that we might always be wrong about anything we claim to know—that is, because we can never know anything with absolute certainty. This is not quite the claim of the ancient Skeptics. Arguing from a position of fallibilism, these latter feel that we ought never to make any final judgments that go beyond the immediate evidence, or the immediate appearances. We should simply accept what appears at face value and have no further beliefs about its ultimate consequences, or its ultimate value. In particular, we should refrain from making judgments about whether it is good or bad for us. We bracket (epoche) these ultimate judgments. When we see that such things are beyond our ability to know with certainty, we will learn to let go of our anxieties and accept the things that happen to us with equanimity. Such a state of emotional tranquility they call 'ataraxia.'

Now, the resonances with Zhuangzi's philosophy are clear. Zhuangzi also accepts a form of fallibilism. While he does not refrain from making judgments, he nevertheless acknowledges that we cannot be certain that what we think of as good for us may not ultimately be bad for us, or that what we now think of as something terrible to be feared (death, for example) might not be an extraordinarily blissful awakening and a release from the toils and miseries of worldly life. When we accept this, we refrain from dividing things into the acceptable and the unacceptable; we learn to accept the changes of things in all their aspects with equanimity. In the Skeptical reading, the textual contradictions are also resolved by appealing to different perspectives from which different judgments appear to be true. Once one has learnt how to shift easily between the perspectives from which such different judgments can be made, then one can see how such apparently contradictory things can be true at the same time—and one no longer feels compelled to choose between them.

There is another way to resolve these contradictions, which involves recognizing the importance of continuous transformation between opposites. In the tradition of Laozi's cosmology, Zhuangzi's worldview is also one of seasonal transformations of opposites. The world is seen as a giant clod (da kuai) around which the heavens (tian) revolve about a polar axis (daoshu). All transformations have such an axis, and the aim of the sage is to settle into this axis, so that one may observe the changes without being buffeted around by them.

Now, the theme of opposites is taken up by the Mohists, in their later Mohist Canon, but with a very different understanding. The later Mohists present a detailed analysis of judgments as requiring bivalence: that is judgments may be acceptable (ke) (also, 'affirmed' shi) or unacceptable (buke) (also 'rejected'fei); they must be one or the other and they cannot be both. There must always be a clear distinction between the two. It is to this claim, I believe, that Zhuangzi is directly responding. Rejecting also the Mohist style of discussion, he appeals to an allusive, aphoristic, mythological style of poetic writing to upset the distinctions and blur the boundaries that the Mohists insist must be held apart. The Mohists believe that social harmony can only be achieved when we have clarity of distinctions, especially of evaluative distinctions: true/false, good/bad, beneficial/harmful. Zhuangzi's position is that this kind of sharp and rigid thinking can result ultimately only in harming our natural tendencies (xing), which are themselves neither sharp nor rigid. If we, on the contrary, learn to nurture those aspects of our heart-minds (xin), our natural tendencies (xing), that are in tune with the natural (tian) and ancestral (zong) within us, then we will eventually find our place at the axis of the way (daoshu) and will be able to ride the transformations of the cosmos free from harm. We will be able to sense and respond to what can only be vaguely expressed without forcing it into gross and unwieldy verbal expressions.

Put another way, our knowledge and understanding (zhi, tong, da) are not just what we can explicitly see before us and verbalize: in modern terms, they are not just what is 'consciously,' 'conceptually,' or 'linguistically' available to us. Zhuangzi also insists on a level of understanding that goes beyond such relatively crude modes of dividing up our world and experiences. There are hidden modes of knowing, not evident or obviously present, modes that allow us to live, breathe, move, understand, connect with others without words, read our environments through subtle signs; these modes of knowing also give us tremendous skill in coping with others and with our environments. These modes of knowing Zhuangzi callswuzhi, literally 'without knowing,' or 'unknowing,' which Hall and Ames render as 'unprincipled knowing.' What is known by such modes of knowing, when we attempt to express it in words, becomes paradoxical and appears contradictory. It seems that bivalent distinctions leave out too much on either side of the divide: they are too crude a tool to cope with the subtlety and complexity of our non-conceptual modes of knowing. Zhuangzi, following a traditional folk psychology of his time, calls this capacity shenming: "spirit insight."

When we nurture that deepest and most natural, most ancestral part of our pysches, through psycho-physical meditative practices, we at the same time nurture these non-cognitive modes of understanding, embodied wisdoms, that enable us to deal successfully with our circumstances. It is then that we are able to cope directly with what from the limited perspective of our socialized and 'linguistic' understanding seems to be too vague, too open, too paradoxical.

c. Chapter 3: Yang Sheng Zhu (The Principle of Nurturing Life)

This chapter, like the Anarchist chapters, deals with the way to nurture and cultivate one's 'life force' (sheng, xing) so as to enable one to live skillfully and last out one's natural years (qiong qi tian nian). There is a 'life' within one that is a source of longevity, an ancestral place from which the phenomena of one's life continue to arise. This place is to be protected (bao), kept whole (quan), nurtured and cultivated (yang). The result is a sagely and skillful life. We must be careful how we understand this word, 'skill.' Zhuangzi takes pains to point out that it is no mere technique. A technique is a procedure that may be mastered, but the skill of the sage goes beyond this. One might say that it has become an 'art,' a dao. With Zhuangzi's conception, any physical activity, whether butchering a carcass, making wooden wheels, or carving beautiful ceremonial bell stands, becomes a dao when it is performed in a spiritual state of heightened awareness ('attenuation' xu).

Zhuangzi sees civic involvement as particularly inimical to the preservation and cultivation of one's natural life. In order to cultivate one's natural potencies, one must retreat from social life, or at least one must retreat from the highly complex and artificially structured social life of the city. One undergoes a psycho-physical training in which one's sensory and physical capacities become honed to an extraordinary degree, indicating one's attunement with the transformations of nature, and thus highly responsive to the tendencies (xing) of all things, people, and processes. The mastery achieved is demonstrated (both metaphorically, and literally) by practical embodied skill. That is, practical embodied skill is a metaphor representing the mastery of the life of the sage, and is also quite literally a sign of sagehood (though not all those who are skillful are to be reckoned as sages). Thus, we see many examples of individuals who have achieved extraordinary levels of excellence in their achievements—practical, aesthetic, and spiritual. Butcher Ding provides an example of a practical, and very lowly, skill; Liezi's teacher, Huzi, in chapter 7, an example of skill in controlling the very life force itself. Chapter 19, Mastering Life, is replete with examples: a cicada catcher, a ferryman, a carpenter, a swimmer, and Woodcarver Qing, whose aesthetic skill reaches magical heights.

d. Chapter 4: Ren Jian Shi (The Realm of Human Interactions)

In this chapter, Zhuangzi continues the theme broached by the last chapter, but now takes on the problem of how to protect and preserve one's life and last out one's years while living in the social realm, especially in circumstances of great danger: a life of civic engagement in a time of social corruption.

The Daoists, and Primitivists in general, are highly critical of the artificiality required to create and sustain complex social structures. The Daoists are skeptical of the ability of deliberate planning to deal with the complexities of the world within which our social structures have their place. Even the developments of the social world when left to themselves are 'natural' developments, and as such escape the confines of planned, structured thinking. The more we try to control and curtail these natural meanderings, the more complicated and unwieldy the social structures become. According to the Daoists, no matter how complex we make our structures, they will never be fully able to cope with the fluid flexibility of natural changes. The Daoists perceive the unfolding of the transformations of nature as exhibiting a kind of natural intelligence, a wisdom that cannot be matched by deliberate artificial thinking, thinking that can be articulated in words. The result is that phenomena guided by such artificial structures quickly lose their course, and have to be constantly regulated, re-calibrated. This gives rise to the development and articulation of the artificial concepts of ren and yi for the Ruists, and shi and fei for the Mohists.

The Ruists emphasize the importance of cultivating the values of ren 'humanity' and yi'appropriateness/rightness.' The Mohists identify a bivalent structure of preference and evaluation. Our judgments can be positive or negative, and these arise out of our acceptance and rejection of things or of judgments, and these in turn arise out of our emotional responses to the phenomena of benefit and harm, that is, pleasure and pain. Thus, we set up one of two types of systems: the intuitive renyi morality of the Ruists, or the articulated structured shifei of the Mohists.

Zhuangzi sees both of these as dangerous. Neither can keep up with the complex transformations of things and so both will result in harm to our shen and xing. They lead to the desire of rulers to increase their personal profit, their pleasure, and their power, and to do so at the expense of others. The best thing is to steer clear of such situations. But there are times when one cannot do so: there is nothing one can do to avoid involvement in a social undertaking. There are also times—if one has a Ruist sensibility—when one will be moved to do what one can and must in order to improve the social situation. Zhuangzi makes up a story about Confucius' most beloved and most virtuous follower, Yen Hui, who feels called to help 'rectify' the King of a state known for his selfishness and brutality.

Zhuangzi thinks that such a motivation, while admirable, is ultimately misguided. There is little to nothing one can do to change things in a corrupt world. But if you really have to try, then you should be aware of the dangers, be aware of the natures of things, and of how they transform and develop. Be on the lookout for the 'triggers': the critical junctures at which a situation can explode out of hand. In the presence of danger, do not confront it: always dance to one side, redirect it through skilled and subtle manipulations, that do not take control, but by adding their own weight appropriately, redirect the momentum of the situation. One must treat all dangerous social undertakings as a Daoist adept: one must perform xinzhai, fasting of the heart-mind. This is a psycho-physical discipline of attenuation, in which one nurtures one's inner potencies, until one achieves a heightened sensitivity to the tendencies of things. One then responds with the skill of a sage to the dangerous moods and intentions of one's worldly ruler.

e. Chapter 5: De Chong Fu (Signs of the Flourishing of Potency)

This chapter is populated with a collection of characters with bodily eccentricities: criminals with amputated feet, people born with ‘ugly' deformities, hunchbacks with no lips. Perhaps some of these are moralistic advisors, like those of chapter 4, who were unsuccessful in bringing virtue and harmony to a corrupt state, and instead received the harsh punishment of their offended ruler? But it is also possible that some were born with these physical 'deformities.' As the Commander of the Right says in chapter 3, "When tian (nature) gave me life, it saw to it that I would be one footed." These then are people whose natural capacity (de) has been twisted somehow, redirected, so that it gives them a potency (de) that is beyond the normal human range. At any rate, this out of the ordinary appearance, this extraordinary physical form, is a sign of something deeper: a potency and a power (de) that connects them more closely to the ancestral source. These are the sages that Zhuangzi admires: those whose virtue (de) is beyond the ordinary, and whose signs of virtue indicate that they have gone beyond.

But what goes beyond is also the source of life. To hold fast to that which is beyond both living and dying, is perhaps also to hold fast to something that is beyond human and inhuman. To identify with and nurture this source is to nurture that which is at the root of our humanity. Thus to go to that which is beyond is not necessarily to become inhuman. Indeed, one might argue that it is to create the possibility of deepening one's most genuine humanity, insofar as this is a deeper nature still.

f. Chapter 6: Da Zong Shi (The Vast Ancestral Teacher)

The first part of this chapter is devoted to a discussion of the zhenren: the "True Man," the "genuine person," or "genuine humanity." It begins by asking about the relation between tian and ren, the natural/heaven and the human, and suggests that the greatest wisdom lies in the ability to understand both. Thus, to be forced to choose between being natural or being human is a mistake. A genuinely flourishing human life cannot be separated from the natural, but nor can it on that account deny its own humanity. Genuine humanity is natural humanity.

There are several sections devoted to explicating this genuine humanity. We find that the genuinely human person, the zhen ren, is in tune with the cycles of nature, and is not upset by the vicissitudes of life. Thezhenren like Laozi's sage is somehow simultaneously unified with things, and yet not tied down by them. The zhenren is in tune with the cycles of nature, and with the cycles of yin yang, and is not disturbed or harmed by them. In fact, the zhenren is not harmed by them either in what appears to us to be their negative phases, nor are their most extreme phases able to upset the balance of the zhenren. This is sometimes expressed with what I take to be the hyperbole that the sage or zhenren can never be drowned by the ocean, nor burned by fire. However, followers of what has come to be known as "religious" Daoism would, I believe, probably take these statements more literally.

In the second part of the chapter, Zhuangzi hints at the process by which we are to cultivate our genuine and natural humanity. These are meditative practices and psycho-physical disciplines—"yogas" perhaps—by which we learn how to nourish the ancestral root of life that is within us. We learn how to identify with that center which functions as an axis of stability around which the cycles of emotional turbulence flow. By maintaining ourselves as a shifting and responding center of gravity we are able to maintain an equanimity without giving up our feelings altogether. We enjoy riding the dragon without being thrown around by it. Ordinarily, we are buffeted around like flotsam in a storm, and yet, by holding fast to our ancestral nature, and by following the nature of the environment—by "matching nature with nature"—we free ourselves from the mercy of random circumstances.

In this chapter we see a mature development of the ideas of life and death broached in the first three chapters. Zhuangzi continues musing on the significance of our existential predicament as being inextricably tied into interweaving cycles of darkness and light, sadness and joy, living and dying. In chapter two, it was the predicament itself that Zhuangzi described, and he tried to focus on the inseparability and indistinguishability of the two aspects of this single process of transformation. In this chapter, Zhuangzi tries to delve deeper to reach the center of balance, the 'axis of the way,' that allows one to undergo these changes with tranquility, and even to accept them with a kind of 'joy.' Not an ecstatic affirmation, to be sure, but a tranquil appreciation of the richness, beauty, and "inevitability" of whatever experiences we eventually will undergo. Again, not that we must experience whatever is 'fated' for us, or that we ought not to minimize harm and suffering where we can do so, but only that we should acknowledge and accept our situatedness, our thrownness into our situation, as the 'raw materials' that we have to deal with.

There are mystical practices hinted at that enable the sage to identify with the datong, the greater flow, not with the particular arisings of these particular emotions, or this particular body, but with what lies within (and below and above) as their ancestral root. These meditative and yogic practices are hinted at in this chapter, and also in chapter 7, but nothing in the text reveals what they are. It is not unreasonable to believe that similar techniques have been handed down by the practitioners of religious Daoism. It is clear, nonetheless, that part of the change is a change in self-understanding, self-identification. We somehow learn to expand, to wander beyond, our boundaries until they include the entire cosmic process. This entire process is seen as like a potter's wheel, and simultaneously as a whetstone and as a grindstone, on which things are formed, and arise, sharpened, and are ground back down only to be made into new forms. With each 'birth' (sheng) some 'thing' (wu) new arises, flourishes, develops through its natural (tian) tendencies (xing), and then still following its natural tendencies, responding to those of its natural environment, it winds down: enters (ru) back into the undifferentiated (wu) from which it emerged (chu). The truest friendship arises when members of a community identify with this unknown undifferentiated process in which they are embedded, "forgotten" differences between self and other, and spontaneously follows the natural developments of which they are inseparable "parts."

g. Chapter 7: Ying Di Wang (Responding to Emperors and Kings)

The last of the Inner Chapters does not introduce anything new, but closes by returning to a recurring theme from chapters 1, 3, 5, and 6: that of withdrawing from society. This 'withdrawal' has two functions: the first is to preserve one's 'life'; the second is to allow society to function naturally, and thus to bring itself to a harmonious completion. Rather than interfering with social interactions, one should allow them to follow their natural course, which, Zhuangzi believes, will be both imaginative and harmonious.

These themes resonate with those of the Anarchist chapters in the Outer (and Miscellaneous) chapters: 8 to 11a and 28 to 32. These encourage a life closer to nature in which one lets go of deliberate control and instead learns how to sense the tendencies of things, allowing them to manifest and flourish, while also adding one's weight to redirect their momentum away from harm and danger. Or, if harm and danger are unavoidable, then one learns how to minimize them, and how to accept whatever one does have to suffer with equanimity.

4. Key Interpreters of Zhuangzi

The earliest of the interpreters of Zhuangzi's philosophy are of course his followers, whose commentaries and interpretations have been preserved in the text itself, in the chapters that Liu Xiaogan ascribes to the "Shu Zhuang Pai," chapters 17 to 27. Most of these chapters constitute holistic developments of the ideas of the Inner Chapters, but some of them concentrate on particular issues raised in particular chapters. For example, the author of Chapter 17, the Autumn Floods, elaborates on the philosophy of perspective and overcoming boundaries that is discussed in the first chapter, Xiao Yao You. This chapter develops the ideas in several divergent directions: relativism, skepticism, pragmatism, and even a kind of absolutism. Which of these, if any, is the overall philosophical perspective is not easy to discern. The author of chapter 19, Da Sheng, Mastering Life, takes up the theme of the cultivation of the wisdom of embodied skill that is introduced in chapter 3, Yang Sheng Zhu, The Principle of Nurturing Life. The author of chapter 18, Zhi Le, Utmost Happiness, and chapter 22, Zhi Bei You, Knowledge Wanders North, continues the meditations on life and death, and the cultivation of meditative practice, that are explored in chapter 6, Da Zong Shi, The Vast Ancestral Teacher.

The next group of interpreters have also become incorporated into the extant version of the text. They are the school of anarchistically inclined philosophers, that Graham identifies as a "Primitivist" and a school of “Yangists,” chapters 8 to 11, and 28 to 31. These thinkers appear to have been profoundly influenced by the Laozi, and also by the thought of the first and last of the Inner Chapters: “Wandering Beyond,” and “Responding to Emperors and Kings.” There are also possible signs of influence from Yang Zhu, whose concern was to protect and cultivate one's inner life-source. These chapters combine the anarchistic ideals of a simple life close to nature that can be found in the Laozi with the practices that lead to the cultivation and nurturing of life. The practice of the nurturing of life in chapter 3, that leads to the “lasting out of one’s natural years,” becomes an emphasis on maintaining and protecting xing ming zhi qing “the essentials of nature and life’s command” in these later chapters.

The third main group, whose interpretation has been preserved in the text itself, is the Huang-Lao school, an eclectic school whose aim to is promote an ideal of mystical rulership, influenced by the major philosophical schools of the time, especially those that recommend a cultivation of inner potency. They scoured the earlier philosophers in order to extract what was valuable in their philosophies, the element of the dao that is to be found in each philosophical claim. In particular, they sought to combine the more ‘mystically' inclined philosophies with the more practical ones to create a more complete dao. The last chapter, Tian Xia, The World, considers several philosophical schools, and comments on what is worthwhile in each of them. Zhuangzi’s philosophy is here characterized as "vast," “vague,” “outrageous,” “extravagant,” and “reckless”; he is also recognized for his encompassing modes of thought, his lack of partisanship, and his recklessness is acknowledged to be harmless. Nevertheless, it is stated that he did not succeed in getting it all.

Perhaps the most important of the pre-Qin thinkers to comment on Zhuangzi is Xunzi. In his "Dispelling Obsessions" chapter, anticipating the eclecticism of the Huang-Lao commentators of chapter 33, he considers several philosophical schools, mentions the corner of ‘truth' that each has recognized, and then goes on to criticize them for failing to understand the larger picture. Xunzi mentions Zhuangzi by name, describes him as a philosopher who recognizes the value of nature and of following the tendencies of nature, but who thereby fails to recognize the value of the human ‘ren’. Indeed, Zhuangzi seems to be aware of this kind of objection, and even delights in it. He revels in knowing that he is one who wanders off into the distance, far from human concerns, one who is not bound by the guidelines. Perhaps in doing so he corroborates Xunzi’s fears.

Another text that reveals what might be a development of Zhuangzi's philosophy is the Liezi. This is a philosophical treatise that clearly stands in the same tradition as the Zhuangzi, dealing with many of the same issues, and on occasion with almost identical stories and discussions. Although the Daoist adept, Liezi, to whom the text is attributed lived before Zhuangzi, the text clearly dates from a later period, perhaps compiled as late as the Eastern Han, though in terms of linguistic style the material appears to date from around the same period as Zhuangzi. The Liezi continues the line of philosophical thinking of the Xiao Yao You, and the Qiu Shui, taking up the themes of transcending boundaries, and even cosmic realms, by spirit journeying. The leaving behind and overturning of human values is a theme that is repeated in this text, though again not without a certain paradoxical tension: after all, the purpose of such journeying and overturning of values is ultimately to enable us in some sense to live ‘better’ lives. While Zhuangzi’s own philosophy exerted a significant influence on the interpretation of Buddhism in China, theLiezi appears to provide a possible converse case of Mahayana Buddhist influence on the development of the ideas of Zhuangzi.

The Jin dynasty scholar, Guo Xiang, is the most influential of the early interpreters. His "relativistic" reading of the text has become the received interpretation, and his own distinctive style of philosophical thinking has in this way become almost inseparable from that of Zhuangzi. The task of interpreting Zhuangzi independently of Guo Xiang's reading is not easy to accomplish. His contribution and interpretation have already been discussed in the body of the entry (See sections above: The Zhuangzitext, and Chapter 2: Qi Wu Lun (Discussion on Smoothing Things Out) ). The Sui dynasty scholar, Lu Deming, produced an invaluable glossary and philological commentary on the text, enabling later generations to benefit from his vast linguistic expertise. The Ming dynasty Buddhist poet and scholar, Han Shan, wrote a commentary on the Zhuangzi from a Chan Buddhist perspective. In a similar vein, the Qing dynasty scholar, Zhang Taiyan, constructed a masterful interpretation of the Zhuangzi in the light of Chinese Buddhist Idealism, or Weishilun. Guo Qingfan, a late Qing, early twentieth century scholar, collected and synthesized the work of previous generations of commentators. The scholarly work of Takeushi Yoshio in Japan has also been of considerable influence. Qian Mu is a twentieth century scholar who has exerted considerable efforts with regard to historical scholarship. Currently, in Taiwan, Chen Guying is the leading scholar and interpreter of Zhuangzi, and he uses his knowledge of western philosophy, particularly western epistemology, cosmology, and metaphysics, to throw new light on this ancient text.

In the west, probably the most important and influential scholar was A. C. Graham, whose pioneering work on this text, and on the later Mohist Canon, has laid the groundwork and set an extraordinarily high standard for future western philosophical scholarship. Graham, following the reading of Guo Xiang, develops a relativistic reading based on a theory of the conventional nature of language. Chad Hansen is a current interpreter who sees the Daoists as largely theorists of language, and he interprets Zhuangzi's own contribution as a form of "linguistic skepticism." Recently, there has been a growth of interest in the aspects of Zhuangzi’s philosophy that resonate with the Hellenistic school of Skepticism. This was proposed by Paul Kjellberg, and has been pursued by other scholars such as Lisa Raphals.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, Roger, ed. Wandering at Ease in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1998.
  • Chuang Tzu. Basic Writings. Translated by Burton Watson. New York: Columbia University Press, 1964.
  • Chuang Tzu. The Complete Works of Chuang Tzu. Translated by Burton Watson. New York: Columbia University Press, 1968.
  • Chuang Tzu. Chuang-Tzu The Inner Chapters: A Classic of Tao. Translated by A. C. Graham. London: Mandala, 1991.
  • Chuang Tzu. Chuang tzu. Translated by James Legge, Sacred Books of the East, volumes 39, 40. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1891.
  • Cook, Scott. Hiding the World Within the World: Ten Uneven Discourses on Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Coutinho, Steve. Zhuangzi and Early Chinese Philosophy: Vagueness, Transformation, and Paradox. London: Ashgate Press, forthcoming, December, 2004.
  • Fung, Yu-Lan. Chuang-Tzu: A New Selected Translation with an Exposition of the Philosophy of Kuo Hsiang. 2nd ed. New York: Paragon Book Reprint Corporation, 1964.
  • Graham, Angus Charles. Later Mohist Logic, Ethics and Science. London: School of Oriental and African Studies, 1978.
  • Graham, Angus Charles. Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical Argument in Ancient China. La Salle: Open Court, 1989.
  • Graham, A. C. "Chuang-tzu's Essay on Seeing things as Equal." History of Religions 9 (1969/1970), pp. 137—159. Reproduced in Roth, 2003.
  • Graham, A. C. "Chuang-tzu: Textual Notes to a Partial Translation." London: School of Oriental and African Studies, 1982. Reproduced in Roth, 2003.
  • Hansen, Chad. A Daoist Theory of Chinese Thought: A Philosophical Interpretation. New York, Oxford University Press, 1992.
  • Ivanhoe, P. J. & Paul Kjellberg, ed. Essays on Skepticism, Relativism, and Ethics in the Zhuangzi. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1996.
  • Kaltenmark, Max. Lao Tzu and Taoism. Translated by Roger Greaves. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1969.
  • Kjellberg, Paul. Zhuangzi and Skepticism. PhD dissertation, Department of Philosophy, Stanford University, 1993.
  • Lawton, Thomas, ed. New Perspectives on Chu Culture During the Eastern Zhou Period. Washington, D.C.: Smithsonian Institution, 1991.
  • Li, Xueqin. Eastern Zhou and Qin Civilizations. Translated by Kwang-chih Chang. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1985.
  • Liu, Xiaogan. Classifying the Zhuangzi Chapters. Translated by Donald Munro. Michigan Monographs in Chinese Studies, no. 65. Ann Arbor, Michigan: The University of Michigan, 1994.
  • Mair, Victor H., ed. Experimental Essays on Chuang-tzu. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1983.
  • Mair, Victor. ed. Chuang-tzu: Composition and Interpretation. Symposium issues, Journal of Chinese Religions 11, 1983.
  • Mair, Victor. Wandering on the Way: Early Taoist Tales and Parables of Chuang Tzu. New York: Bantam Books, 1994.
  • Maspero, Henri. Le Taoïsme. Vol. II, Mélanges Posthumes sur les Religions et l'histoire de la Chine. Paris: Civilisations du Sud S.A.E.P., 1950.
  • Roth, Harold. "Who Compiled the Chuang-tzu?" in Chinese Texts and Philosophical Contexts. edited by Henry Rosemont. La Salle: Open Court, 1991.
  • Roth, Harold. A Companion to A. C. Graham's Chuang Tzu: The Inner Chapters. Honolulu: University of Hawai’i Press, 2003.
  • Wu, Kuang-ming. The Butterfly as Companion: Meditations on the First Three Chapters of the Chuang Tzu. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1990.

Author Information

Steve Coutinho
Muhlenberg College
U. S. A.

Zhang Zai (Chang Tsai, 1020—1077)

Chang_TsaiZhang Zai was one of the pioneers of the Song dynasty philosophical movement called "Study of the Way," often known as Neo-Confucianism. One of the most distinctive features of many of these new ways of thought being formulated at the time was an increased interest in metaphysics, usually influenced by the Classic of Changes (Yijing). Zhang's most significant contributions to Chinese philosophy were primarily in the area of metaphysics, where he came up with a new theory of qi that was very influential. He is also credited with differentiating original nature and physical nature, which was to become a key concept in the most prominent Song philosophers, the Cheng brothers and Zhu Xi (Chu Hsi). Ethically, his most influential doctrines were found in the brief essay "Western Inscription," where he propounded the ideas of being one body with all things and universal caring. After his death, most of his disciples were absorbed into the Cheng brothers' school and his thought become known primarily through the efforts of the Cheng brothers and Zhu Xi, who honored Zhang as one of the founders of the Study of the Way.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Metaphysics
  3. Human Nature and Ethics
  4. Moral Education and the Heart
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Zhang Zai is also known as Zhang Hengqu, after the town where he grew up and later did much of his teaching. He was born in 1020 and died in 1077. As a youth he was interested in military affairs, but began studying the Confucian texts on the recommendation of an important official who was impressed with Zhang's abilities. Like most of the Song philosophers, Zhang was initially dissatisfied with Confucian thought and studied Buddhism and Daoism for several years. Eventually, however, he decided that the Way was not to be found in Buddhism or Daoism and returned to Confucian texts. This acquaintance with the other major ways of thought was to have significant influence on Zhang's own views. According to tradition, around 1056 Zhang sat on a tiger skin in the capital and lectured on the Classic of Changes. It may have been during this period that he first became acquainted with the Cheng brothers, who were actually his younger cousins. After passing the highest level of the civil service examinations, he held a series of minor government posts.

In 1069 Zhang was recommended to the emperor and given a position in the capital, but not long after he ran into conflict with the prime minister and retired home to Hengqu, where he spent his time in retirement studying and teaching. This was probably his most productive period for developing and spreading his own philosophy. In 1076 he completed his most important work, Correcting Ignorance, and presented it to his disciples. "Western Inscription" was originally part of this longer work. That same year he was summoned back to the capital and restored to an important position. However, in the winter he became ill and resigned again to try to convalesce at home. He never reached home, dying on the road in 1077. Zhang was awarded a posthumous title in 1220 and enshrined in the Confucian temple in 1241. Many of Zhang's writings have been lost. Zhu Xi collected selections of Zhang’s writings in his anthology of Song Study of the Way known as Reflections on Things at Hand. His most important surviving works are probably his commentary on the Changes and Correcting Ignorance.

2. Metaphysics

Zhang Zai's metaphysics is largely based on the Classic of Changes, especially one of the commentaries, "Appended Remarks," traditionally attributed to Confucius. According to Zhang, all things of the world are composed of a primordial substance called qiQi is sometimes translated as "substance," “matter,” or “material force, but there is really no term in English that can capture its meaning for Zhang. Qi originally meant "breath" and is a very old concept in Chinese culture, particularly medicine. For Zhang, qi includes matter and the forces that govern interactions between matter, yin and yang. In its dispersed, rarefied state, qi is invisible and insubstantial, but when it condenses it becomes a solid or liquid and takes on new properties. All material things are composed of condensed qi: rocks, trees, even people. There is nothing that is not qi. Thus, in a real sense, everything has the same essence, an idea which has important ethical implications.

Zhang believed that qi is never created or destroyed; the same qi goes through a continuous process of condensation and dispersion. He compared it to water: water in liquid form or frozen into ice is still the same water. Similarly, condensed qi which forms things or dispersed qi is still the same substance. Condensation is theyin force of qi and dispersion is the yang force. In its wholly dispersed state, Zhang refers to qi as the Great Vacuity, a term he adopted from the Zhuangzi. He emphasized that though this qi is insubstantial, it still exists, and thus is very different from the Buddhist concept of emptiness. Whereas Buddhists argued that the fact that everything changes shows it has no essence and is unreal, Zhang argued that the very fact that it changes proves it is real. Everything that is real is composed of qi, and since qi always changes, anything real must change. Although the Great Vacuity always exists, the particular qi that is dispersed into the Great Vacuity at any time is not the same, which allows Zhang to assert both that qi always changes and the Great Vacuity always remains. There is no such thing as creation ex nihilo for Zhang, an idea he attributes to both Buddhists and Daoists.

Qi begins dispersed and undifferentiated in the Great Vacuity and through condensation forms material things. When these material things pass away, their qi disperses and rejoins the Great Vacuity to begin the process again. What looks like creation and destruction is just the never-ending movements of qi. These processes of condensation and dispersion have no outside cause; they are just part of the nature of qi. Zhang wholly naturalized the workings of qi and rejected any idea of an anthropomorphic Heaven that controlled things. While the Classic of Changes talked of the workings of ghosts and spirits, he reinterpreted these terms to mean the extending and receding of qi from and back to the Great Vacuity. It is all a naturally occurring process.

Unlike later thinkers like the Cheng brothers and Zhu Xi, the concept of pattern (li, also translated as "principle") is not that important in Zhang's philosophy. While in the thought of Cheng Yi and Zhu Xi, pattern is a transcendental universal that exists outside of qi, Zhang denied there was anything outside of qi. He seems to use pattern to describe the actions of qi condensing and dispersing, and for the pattern actions should fit to be moral. It certainly has none of the importance for Zhang that it did for some of his successors. Zhu Xi criticized Zhang for this, saying that qi was not enough to explain the workings of the universe without pattern as well.

3. Human Nature and Ethics

Mencius's belief that human nature is good, and his theory of qi allowed him to come up with what became the definitive Song answer to a classic problem in Mencius' thought: if human nature is good, what makes people bad? Zhang's solution involved positing two ways of looking at nature: the original nature and nature embodied in qi. Zhang claimed original nature exists forever in unchanging perfection, as opposed to material things which decay and die. This raises the question of what original nature consists of, since Zhang has claimed that everything is qi and qi always changes. He is not very clear on this point, but he apparently identified original nature with the undifferentiated qi of the Great Vacuity. When qi condenses to form human beings, each somehow retains some of the character of the unity of the Great Vacuity (or Great Harmony, as he sometimes calls it). This is the original nature, and that is what is good.

However, human beings also have a nature embodied in qi, which Zhang calls physical nature. Being ordinary qi, physical nature changes, eventually dissipating upon death. Zhang theorized that the physical nature obscures the original nature, preventing it from being fulfilled, and this is what causes people to stray from the path of goodness. At one point, he stated that if clear yang qi formed the greater part of physical nature one's moral capacities would function, but if turbid yin qi dominated, material desires would hold sway. However, it is unclear whether he meant all yang qi was clear and all yin qi was turbid, and he often seems to attach no particular moral weight to whether qi is primarily yang (dispersed) or yin (condensed). As we are all different individuals, we all have slightly different physical natures. Some people are naturally bigger and stronger, some are more generous, some are wiser. This is all a result of the particular endowment of qi that makes up the individual, and since qi condenses into things without cause or direction, there is no reason an individual has the particular physical nature he starts out with: it is just a matter of chance. What is important in terms of moral cultivation is there is also the potential to transform one's physical nature and fulfill one’s original nature.

Zhang had a deep faith in the potential for human improvement. Like earlier Confucian thinkers such as Mencius and Xunzi, he believed that moral development was a matter of effort, not ability. In a departure from his metaphysical views, where he held that qi changes naturally with no particular rhyme or reason, he claimed that the human heart has the capacity to alter one's own qi. One can change one’s physical nature in order to fulfill one's original nature. If that were not possible, goodness would be a matter of chance, being born with the right kind of qi. Zhang said that only the qi of life span, which determines whether one dies young or lives to an old age, cannot be changed. This was Zhang's attack on longevity-oriented Daoists, who taught techniques that promised to increase one's life span or even confer immortality. Undoubtedly, part of the goal of Zhang's theory of qi and physical nature was to refute Buddhist and Daoist teachings.Many Song and Ming thinkers, such as Zhu Xi and Wang Yangming, identified desires as one of the main obstacles to moral development. Zhang Zai was no exception to this trend, which was also probably due to Buddhist influence. The issue of how to moderate or channel desires had been discussed in Chinese philosophy at least since Mencius and Xunzi, but while the earlier Confucian tradition had emphasized finding the proper outlet to express desires and not letting them entirely control one's actions, eliminating desires entirely never seemed to be a real option. In Xunzi's case, at least, he clearly denied it was possible to get rid of desires. Eliminating desires was a main focus of Buddhism, on the other hand, and this view of desires was adopted by many of these Study of the Way philosophers. These thinkers focused mainly on what we might call sensual desires. The desire to be a good person was naturally not a cause for concern, but desires for fine clothes, good food, and sex were seen as interfering with one's original nature. Zhang used the term "material desires," identifying them with physical nature, so they had to be overcome to return to one's original nature. Desires somehow arise from the interaction of yin and yang that produces material objects, though Zhang is none too clear exactly what this process is. The fundamental point is that following one's desires is giving into physical nature and regressing farther and farther away from original goodness.

Overcoming the desires of physical nature, one progresses toward original nature, or the heavenly within, as Zhang also put it. In "Western Inscription" Zhang illustrated this ideal state. Putting aside selfishness, one comes to understand the essential unity of all things. All things are formed from the same qi, and ultimately we all share the same substance. This was to become Zhang's most famous ethical doctrine, the idea of forming one body with all things. As Zhang wrote in "Western Inscription, “That which fills the universe I regard as my body." Everyone has Heaven and Earth as their father and mother, and thus everyone are brothers and sisters. Caring for others is like caring for one's own family. Zhang further wrote, "Even those who are tired, infirm, crippled, or sick; those who have no brothers or children, wives, or husbands, are all my brothers who are in distress and have no one to turn to." Though there are some precedents for this idea of brotherhood in earlier Confucianism, it sounds much more like the great compassion of Buddhism or the Mohist idea of universal caring—Zhang even uses the same term (jian'ai). In response to a question about this apparent slide into Mohism, Cheng Yi admitted that "Western Inscription" went a little too far, but still defended it as going beyond what previous sages had discussed and being as meritorious as Mencius' idea of the goodness of human nature. Later thinkers recognized "Western Inscription" as Zhang's greatest contribution to the Study of the Way.

4. Moral Education and the Heart

Presaging Zhu Xi, Zhang emphasized the role of education in moral development. Education was the way one transformed one's qi and overcame physical nature. Following earlier philosophers such as Confucius and Xunzi, Zhang insisted that learning should always be directed toward moral cultivation, which in his case meant returning to one's original nature. Knowledge was not important for its own sake, but for its contributions to moral character. Despite this, Zhang's own interests were fairly wide-ranging, and he was especially interested in observing and explaining natural phenomena such as the movements of the stars and planets. Nevertheless, he tended not to emphasize this kind of scientific study in his writings on education, which focused on ritual and the classical Confucian texts. Compared with his contemporaries, Zhang placed more importance on the study of ritual. He believed ritual derived from original nature, and following it helps one hold onto original nature and overcome the obstructions of physical nature. Zhang's interest in the Classic of Changes has already been mentioned, and he also recommended studying the other Confucian classics, the Analects, and Mencius. In contrast to some later Study of the Way philosophers, he did not put a lot of weight on histories, considering them inferior to the classics for helping people transform their qi.

Though Zhang recommended reciting and memorizing these books, he still believed that books were a means to returning to one's original nature, not an end in themselves. Books functioned like a set of directions: they could tell you how to get to the destination, but they should be not confused with the destination. He felt close reading and textual criticism was not necessary, and getting too caught up in the meaning of a word or sentence could detract from understanding the overall meaning. And even in the classics, not everything should be accepted. Zhang recalled Mencius' criticism of literal readings of the Classic of Documents and pointed out the necessity for understanding the classics in light of one's own sense of what is right. This seems to set up a paradox: a student needs to study the classics to return to his original nature and know what is right, but he needs to know what is right to properly understand the classics.

Zhang resolved this contradiction by positing an innate moral sense in everyone that he called "this heart," a term he apparently adopted from the Mencius. "This heart" presumably belongs to the original nature, and is still present even when embodied in qi, but it can be obstructed and blocked by the physical nature. Zhang referred to this situation as the problem of the "fixed heart" blocking “this heart.” The fixed heart means having intentions, certainty, inflexibility, and egotism. Under these conditions, "this heart" will not function properly and one will have difficulty understanding the classics. The learner must get rid of the fixed heart to let "this heart" free. At times, Zhang suggests that reading books itself helps preserve "this heart," and it is this heart itself that understands the Way. Ritual is perhaps more important than books. Zhang once suggested that even the illiterate could still develop "this heart," but apparently ritual was indispensable in overcoming the fixed heart.

Zhang also talked of "expanding the heart" and “making the heart vast." Both these phrases mean eliminating the obstructions of the fixed heart and putting the heart in a state where it is ready to understand. He tended to value knowledge apprehended directly through the heart over knowledge from sense perception. Zhang did not deny the validity of empirical knowledge, but he believed its scope was limited. Knowledge gained from sense perception is just knowledge of things, not knowledge of the Way. Knowledge of the Way is knowledge gained through the virtuous nature, not through sense perception. "Knowledge gained through the virtuous nature" is another way of saying knowledge apprehended directly by the heart, though Zhang seems to be talking more about a kind of mystic experience than rationalism: he wrote that understanding of the Way is not something thought and consideration can bring about.

The goal of moral cultivation was fulfilling one's original nature. This was Zhang Zai's definition of becoming a sage, the term in Chinese philosophy for a perfected person. Another term common in philosophical discourse of the time was integrity or authenticity (cheng). Integrity figured in some important passages in the Doctrine of the Mean, which was one of the most important Confucian texts in Song Study of the Way. Zhang emphasized "integrity resulting from clarity," which he explained as first coming to understanding through study and inquiry and then fulfilling one's nature. This could be a long and difficult process, but if one could persist and make the necessary effort, one could fulfill one's nature and become a sage. There was no greater goal for Zhang.

5. References and Further Reading

Very little is available in English on Zhang Zai. The reader is encouraged to look into general histories of Chinese philosophy, especially those dealing with neo-Confucianism, in addition to the works listed here.

  • Chan, Wing-tsit. A Sourcebook in Chinese Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1963.
    • Translates a selection of Zhang's works, focusing on Correcting Ignorance.
  • Chan, Wing-tsit, trans. Reflections on Things at Hand: The Neo-Confucian Anthology Compiled by Chu Hsi and Lü Tsu-chien. New York: Columbia University Press, 1967.
    • This probably contains the most extensive collection of Zhang's writings in English. Chan includes a finding list to help the reader find the selections of a particular philosopher.
  • Chow, Kai-wing. "Ritual, Cosmology, and Ontology: Chang Tsai's Moral Philosopy." Philosophy East and West 43.2 (April 1993): 201-28.
    • Emphasizes the importance of ritual in moral development.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. "Chang Tsai's Concept of Ch’i." Philosophy East and West 18.4 (October 1968): 247-60.
  • Huang, Siu-chi. "The Moral Point of View of Chang Tsai." Philosophy East and West 21.2 (April 1971): 141-56.
  • Kasoff, Ira. The Thought of Chang Tsai. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984.
    • This is the only English-language monograph on Zhang's philosophy.
  • T'ang, Chün-i. "Chang Tsai’s Theory of Mind and Its Metaphysical Basis." Philosophy East and West 6.2 (July 1956): 113-36.

Author Information

David Elstein
State University of New York at New Paltz
U. S. A.

Xuanzang (Hsüan-tsang) (602—664)

xuanzangXuanzang, world-famous for his sixteen-year pilgrimage to India and career as a translator of Buddhist scriptures, is one of the most illustrious figures in the history of scholastic Chinese Buddhism. Born into a scholarly family at the outset of the Tang (T'ang) Dynasty, he enjoyed a classical Confucian education. Under the influence of his elder brother, a Buddhist monk, however, he developed a keen interest in Buddhist subjects and soon became a monk himself at the age of thirteen. Upon his return to Chang'an in 645, Xuanzang brought back with him a great number of Sanskrit texts, of which he was able to translate only a small portion during the remainder of his lifetime. In addition to his translations of the most essential Mahayana scriptures, Xuanzang authored the Da tang xi yu ji (Ta-T'ang Hsi-yu-chi or Records of the Western Regions of the Great T'ang Dynasty) with the aid of Bianji (Bian-chi). It is through Xuanzang and his chief disciple Kuiji (K'uei-chi) (632-682) that the Faxiang (Fa-hsiang or Yogacara/Consciousness-only) School was initiated in China. In order to honor the famous Buddhist scholar, the Tang Emperor Gaozong (Gao-tsung) cancelled all audiences for three days after Xuanzang's death. (See Romanization systems for Chinese terms.)

Table of Contents

  1. Xuanzang's Beginnings (602-630)
  2. Pilgrimage to India (630-645)
  3. His Return to China and Career as Translator (645-664)
  4. The Faxiang School
    1. The Development of Yogacara
    2. Metaphysics of Mere-Consciousness
    3. Some Objections Answered
    4. The Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra
    5. Faxiang Doctrines
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Xuanzang's Beginnings (602-630)

Born of a family possessing erudition for generations in Yanshi prefecture of Henan province, Xuanzang, whose lay name was Chenhui, was the youngest of four children. His great-grandfather was an official serving as a prefect, his grand-father was appointed as Professor in the National College at the capital, and his father was a Confucianist of the rigid conservative type who gave up office and withdrew into seclusion to escape the political turmoil that gripped China at that time. According to traditional biographies, Xuanzang displayed a precocious intelligence and seriousness, amazing his father by his careful observance of the Confucian rituals at the age of eight. Along with his brothers and sister, he received an early education from his father, who instructed him in classical works on filial piety and several other canonical treatises of orthodox Confucianism.

After the death of Xuanzang's father in 611, his older brother Chensu, later known as Changjie, became the primary influence on his life. As a result, he commenced visiting the monastery of Jingtu at Luoyang where his brother dwelled as a Buddhist monk, and studying sacred texts of the faith with all the ardor of a young convert. When Xuanzang requested to take Buddhist orders at the age of thirteen, the abbot Zheng Shanguo made an exception in his case because of his precocious sapience.

In 618, due to the civil war breaking out in Henan, Xuanzang and his brother sought refuge in the mountains of Sichuan, where he spent three years or so in the monastery of Kong Hui plunging into the study of various Buddhist texts, such as the Abhidharmakosa-sastra (Abhidharma Storehouse Treatise. In 622, he was fully ordained as a monk. Deeply confused by myriad contradictions and discrepancies in the texts, and not receiving any solutions from his Chinese masters, Xuanzang decided to go to India and study in the cradle of Buddhism.

2. Pilgrimage to India (630-645)

An imperial decree by the Emperor Taizong (T'ai-tsung) forbade Xuanzang's proposed visit to India on the grounds on preserving national security. Instead of feeling deterred from his long-standing dream, Xuanzang is said to have experienced a vision that strengthened resolve. In 629, defying imperial proscription, he secretly set out on his epochal journey to the land of the Buddha from Chang'an.

Xuanzang reports that he travelled by night, hiding during the day, enduring many dangers, and bereft of a guide after being abandoned by his companions. After some time in the Gobi Desert, he arrived in Liangzhou in modern Gansu province, the westernmost extent of the Chinese frontier at that time and the southern terminus of the Silk Road trade route connecting China with Central Asia. Here he spent approximately a month preaching the Buddhist message before being invited to Hami by King Qu Wentai (Ch'u Wen-tai) of Turfan, a pious Buddhist of Chinese extraction.

It soon became apparent to Xuanzang that Qu Wentai, although most hospitable and respectful, planned to detain him for life in his Court as its ecclesiastical head. In response, Xuanzang undertook a hunger strike until the king relented, extracting from Xuanzang a promise to return and spend three years in the kingdom upon his return. After remaining there for a month more for the sake of the dharma, Xuanzang resumed his journey in 630, well provided with introductions to all the kings on his itinerary, including the formidable Turkish Khan whose power extended to the very gates of India. Having initially left China against the will of the Emperor, he was no longer an unknown fugitive fleeing in secret, but an accredited pilgrim with official standing.

At long last, Xuanzang reached his ultimate destination, where his strongest personal interest in Buddhism was located and the principal portion of his time abroad was spent: the Nalanda monastery, located southwest of the modern city of Bihar in northern Bihar state. As a far-famed metropolis of Buddhist monastic education, Nalanda was a veritable monastic city consisting of some ten huge temples with spaces between divided into eight compounds, surrounded by a high wall. There were over ten thousand Mahayana monks there engaged in the study of the orthodox Buddhist canon as well as the Vedas, arithmetic, and medicine. According to legend, Silabhadra (529-645), abbot of Nalanda, was considering suicide after years of wasting illness when he received instructions from deities in a dream, commanding him to endure and await the arrival of a Chinese monk in order to guarantee the preservation of the Mahayana tradition abroad. Indeed, Xuanzang became Silabhadra's disciple in 636 and was initiated into the Yogacara lineage of Mahayana learning by the venerable abbot. While at Nalanda, Xuanzang also studied Sanskrit and Brahmana philosophy. Subsequent studies in India included hetu-vidya (logic), the exegesis of Mahayana texts such as the Mahayana-sutralamkara (Treatise on the Scripture of Adorning the Great Vehicle), and Madhyamika ("Middle-ist") doctrines.

The name of the Madhyamika School, founded by Nagarjuna (2nd century CE), derives from its having sought a middle position between the realism of the Sarvastivada (Doctrine That All Is Real) School and the idealism of the Yogacara (Mind Only) School. Xuanzang appears to have combined these two systems into each other in a more eclectic and comprehensive Mahayanism. With the approval of his Nalanda mentors, Xuanzang composed a treatise, Hui zong lun (Hui-tsüng-lun or On the Harmony of the Principles), which articulates his synthesis.

At Nalanda, Xuanzang became a critic of two major philosophical systems of Hinduism opposed to Buddhism: the Samkhya and the Vaiseshika. The former was based upon a dualism of Nature and Spirit. The latter was a realist system, immediate and direct in its realism, resting upon the acceptance of the data of consciousness and experience as such: in brief, it was a melding of monism and atomism. Such beliefs were in absolute contradiction to the acosmic idealism of the Buddhist Yogacara, which evenly repelled the substantial entity of the ego and the objective existence of matter. Xuanzang also critiqued the atheistic monism of the Jains, especially inveighing against what he saw as their caricature of Buddhism in terms of Jain monastic garb and iconography.

Xuanzang's success in religious and philosophical disputes evidently aroused the attention of some Indian potentates, including the King of Assam and the poet-cum-dramatist king Harsha (r. 606-647), who was regarded as a Buddhist patron saint upon the throne like Ashoka and Kanishka of old. An eighteen-day religious assembly was convoked in Harsha's capital of Kanauj during the first week of the year 643, during which Xuanzang allegedly defeated five hundred Brahmins, Jains, and heterodox Buddhists in spirited debate.

Following these public successes in India, Xuanzang resolved to return to China by way of Central Asia. He followed the caravan-track that led across the Pamirs to Dunhuang. In the spring of 644, he reached Khotan and awaited a reply to his request for return addressed to the Emperor Taizong. In the month of November, Xuanzang left for Dunhuang by a decree of the Emperor, and arrived in the Chinese capital Chang'an the first month of the Chinese Lunar Year 645.

3. His Return to China and Career as Translator (645-664)

Traditional sources report that Xuanzang's arrival in Chang'an was greeted with an imperial audience and an offer of official position (which Xuanzang declined), followed by an assembly of all the Buddhist monks of the capital city, who accepted the manuscripts, relics, and statues brought back by the pilgrim and deposited them in the Temple of Great Happiness. It was in this Temple that Xuanzang devoted the rest of his life to the translation of the Sanskrit works that he had brought back out of the wide west, assisted by a staff of more than twenty translators, all well-versed in the knowledge of Chinese, Sanskrit, and Buddhism itself. Besides translating Buddhist texts and dictating the Da tang xi yu ji in 646, Xuanzang also translated the Dao de jing (Tao-te Ching) of Laozi (Lao-tzu) into Sanskrit and sent it to India in 647.

His translations may, by and large, be divided into three phases: the first six years (645-650), focusing on the Yogacarabhumi-sastra; the middle ten years (651-660), centering on the Abhidharmakosa-sastra; and the last four years (661-664), concentrating upon the Maha-prajnaparamita-sutra. In each phase of his career as a translator, Xuanzang saw his task as introducing Indian Buddhist texts to Chinese audiences in all their integrity. According to Thomas Watters, the total number of texts brought by Xuanzang from India to China is six hundred and fifty seven, enumerated as follows:

Mahayanist sutras: 224 items
Mahayanist sastras: 192
Sthavira sutras, sastras and Vinaya: 14
Mahasangika sutras, sastras and Vinaya: 15
Mahisasaka sutras, sastras and Vinaya: 22
Sammitiya sutras, sastras and Vinaya: 15
Kasyapiya sutras, sastra and Vinaya: 17
Dharmagupta sutras, Vinaya, sastras: 42
Sarvastivadin sutras, Vinaya, sastras: 67
Yin-lun (Treatises on the science of Inference): 36
Sheng-lun (Etymological treatises): 13

4. The Faxiang School

a. The Development of Yogacara

The Chinese Faxiang School, derived from the Indian Yogacara (yoga practice) School, is based upon the writings of two brothers, Asanga and Vasubandhu, who explicated a course of practice wherein hindrances are removed according to a sequence of stages, from which it gets its name. The appellation of the school originated with the title of an important fourth- or fifth-century CE text of the school, the Yogacarabhumi-sastra. Yogacara attacked both the provisional practical realism of the Madhyamika School of Mahayana Buddhism and the complete realism of Theravada Buddhism. Madhyamika is regarded as the nihilistic or Emptiness School, whereas Yogacara is seen as the realistic or Existence School. While the former is characterized as Mahayana due to its central theme of emptiness, the latter might be considered to be semi-Mahayana to a point for three basic reasons: (1) the Yogacara remains realistic like the Abhidharma School; (2) it expounds the three vehicles side by side without being confined to the Bodhisattvayana; and (3) it does not accent the doctrine of Buddha nature.

The other name of the school, Vijnanavada (Consciousness-affirming/Doctrine of Consciousness), is more descriptive of its philosophical position, which in short is that the reality a human being perceives does not exist. Yogacara becomes much better known, nevertheless, not for its practices, but for its rich development in psychological and metaphysical theory. The Yogacara thinkers took the theories of the body-mind aggregate of sentient beings that had been under development in earlier Indian schools such as the Sarvastivada, and worked them into a more fully articulated scheme of eight consciousnesses, the most weighty of which was the eighth, or store consciousness -- the alaya-vijnana.

The Yogacara School is also known for the development of other key concepts that would hold great influence not merely within their system, but within all forms of later Mahayana to come. They embody the theory of the three natures of the dependently originated, completely real, and imaginary, which are understood as a Yogacara response to the Madhyamika's truth of emptiness. Yogacara is also the original source for the theory of the three bodies of the Buddha, and greatly expands the notions of categories of elemental constructs.

Yogacara explored and propounded basic doctrines that were to be fundamental in the future growth of Mahayana and that influenced the rise of Tantric Buddhism. Its central doctrine is that only consciousness (vijnanamatra; hence the name Vijnanavada) is real, and that mind is the ultimate reality. In other words, external objects do not exist; nothing exists outside the mind. The common view that external phenomena exist is due to a misconception that is removable through a meditative or yogic process, which brings a complete withdrawal from these fictitious externals, and an inner concentration and tranquility may accordingly be bodied forth.

Yogacara is an alternative system of Buddhist logic. According to it, the object is not at all as it seems, and thus can not be of any service to knowledge. It is therefore unreal when consciousness is the sole reality. The object is only a mode of consciousness. Its appearance although objective and external is in fact the transcendental illusion, because of which consciousness is bifurcated into the subject-object duality. Consciousness is creative and its creativity is governed by the illusive idea of the object. Reality is to be viewed as an Idea or a Will. This creativity is manifested at different levels of consciousness.

Since this school believes that only ideation exists, it is also called the Idealistic School. In China, it was established by Xuanzang and his principal pupil Kuiji who systematized the teaching of his masters recorded in two essential works: the Fa yuan i lin zhang (Fa-yuan i-lin-chang or Chapter on the Forest of Meanings in the Garden of Law) and the Cheng wei shi lun shu ji (Ch'eng wei-shih lun shu-chi or Notes on the Treatise on the Completion of Ideation Only). On account of the school's idealistic accent it is known as Weishi (Wei-shih) or Ideation Only School; yet because it is concerned with the specific character of all the dharmas, it is often called the Faxiang School as well. Besides, this school argues that not all beings possess pure seeds and, therefore, not all of them are capable of attaining Buddhahood.

The central concept of this school is borrowed from a statement by Vasubandhu -- idam sarvam vijnaptimatrakam, "All this world is ideation only." It strongly claims that the external world is merely a fabrication of our consciousness, that the external world does not exist, and that the internal ideation presents an appearance as if it were an outer world. The whole external world is, hence, an illusion according to it.

b. Metaphysics of Mere-Consciousness

Broadly speaking, Mere-Consciousness may cover the eight consciousnesses, the articulation of which forms one of the most seminal and distinctive aspects of the doctrine of the Yogacara School, transmitted to East Asia where it received the somewhat pejorative designations of Dharma-character School and Consciousness-only School. According to this doctrine, sentient beings possess eight distinct layers of consciousness, the first five -- the visual consciousness, auditory consciousness, olfactory consciousness, gustatory consciousness, and tactile consciousness -- corresponding to the sense perceptions, the sixth discriminatory consciousness to the thinking mind, the seventh manas consciousness to the notion of ego, and the eighth alaya-consciousness to the repository of all the impressions from one's past experiences. As the first seven of these arise on the basis of the eighth, they are called the transformed consciousnesses. In contrast, the eighth is known as the base consciousness, store consciousness, or seed consciousness. And in particular, it is this last consciousness that the Mere-Consciousness is all about.

One of the foremost themes discussed in the school is the

alaya-vijnana or storehouse consciousness, which stores and coordinates all the notions reflected in the mind. Thus, it is a storehouse where all the pure and contaminated ideas are blended or interfused. This principle might be illustrated by the school's favorite citation:

"A seed produces a manifestation,
A manifestation perfumes a seed.
The three elements (seed, manifestation, and perfume) turn on and on,
The cause and effect occur at one and the same time."

It is the doctrine of consciousness or mind as the basis for so-called "external" objects that gave the Cittamatra (Mind Only) tradition its name. Apparently external objects are constituted by consciousness and do not exist apart from it. Vasubandhu began his

Vimsatika vijnapti-matrata-siddhih (Twenty Verses on Consciousness-only) by stating: "All this is only perception, since consciousness manifests itself in the form of nonexistent objects." There is only a flow of perceptions. This flow, however, really exists, and it is mental by nature, as in terms of the Buddhist division of things it has to be either mental or physical. The flow of experiences could barely be a physical or material flow. There might be a danger in calling this "idealism," because it is rather dissimilar from forms of idealism in Western philosophy, in which it is deemed necessary for a newcomer to negate and transcend previous theories and philosophies through criticism, but the situation in Buddhism, especially Yogacara Buddhism, is such that it developed its doctrines by inheriting the entire body of thought of its former masters. Nonetheless, if "idealism" denotes that subjects and objects are no more than a flow of experiences and perceptions, which are of the same nature, and these experiences, just as perceptions, are mental, then this could be called a form of "dynamic idealism."

Because this school maintains that no external reality exists, while retaining the position that knowledge exists, assuming knowledge itself is the object of consciousness. It, therefore, postulates a higher storage consciousness, which is the final basis of the apparent individual. The universe consists in an infinite number of possible ideas that lie inactively in storage. Such dormant consciousness projects an interrupted sequence of thoughts, while it itself is in restless flux till the karma, or accumulated consequences of past deeds, blows out. This storage consciousness takes in all the impressions of previous experiences, which shape up the seeds of future karmic action, an illusory force creating outer categories that are actually only fictions of the mind. So illusive a force determines the world of difference and belongs to human nature, sprouting the erroneous notions of an I and a non-I. That duality can only be conquered by enlightenment, which effects the transformation of an ordinary person into a Buddha.

c. Some Objections Answered

Certain objections were interposed to level at Yogacara's doctrine of consciousness. Vasubhandhu, again in his Vimsatika, undertook to prove the invalidity of some of these:

  • Spatiotemporal determination would be impossible -- experiences of object X are not occurrent everywhere and at every time so there must be some external basis for our experiences.
  • Many people experience X and not just one person, as in the case of a hallucination.
  • Hallucinations can be determined because they do not possess pragmatic results. It does not follow that entities, which we generally accept as real, can be placed in the same class.

In reply, Vasubandhu argued that these were after all no objections; they simply failed to show that perception-only as a teaching was beyond the limits of what could be concretely reasoned. Spatiotemporal determination can be elucidated on the analogy of dream experience, where a complete and surreal world is created with objects appearing to have spatiotemporal localization despite the fact that they do not exist apart from the mind which is cognizing them. Moreover, the second objection can be met by recourse to the wider Buddhist religious framework. The hells and their tortures, which are taught by Buddhist beliefs as the result of wicked deeds, and to be endured for a very long time till purified, are experienced as the collective fruit of the previous karmas done by those hell inmates. The torturers of hell obviously can not really exist, otherwise they would have been reborn in hell themselves and would too experience the sufferings associated with it. If this were the case then how could they jovially inflict sufferings upon their fellow inmates? Thus they must be illusive, and yet they are experienced by a number of people. Finally, as in a dream objects bear some pragmatic purpose within that dream, and likewise in hell, so in everyday life. Furthermore, as physical activity can be directed toward unreal objects in a dream owing, it is said, to nervous irritation on the part of the dreamer, so too in daily life.

e. The Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra

Representing a two-hundred-year development within the Vijnanavadin tradition subsequent to the Lankavatara Sutra (Sutra on the Buddha's Entering the Country of Lanka) and being the primary text of the Faxiang School, the Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra is an exhaustive study of the alaya-vijnana and the sevenfold development of the manas, manovijnana, and the five sensorial consciousnesses. As a creative and elaborate exposition of Vasubandhu's Trimsika-vijnapti-matrata-siddhi (Treatise in Thirty Stanzas on Consciousness Only) rendered by Xuanzang in 648 at Great Happiness Monastery, it synthesizes the ten most significant commentaries written on it, and becomes the enchiridion of the new Faxiang School of Buddhist idealism. It is mainly a translation by Xuanzang in 659 of Dharmapala's commentary on the Trimsika-vijnapti-matrata-siddhi, yet it also contains edited translations of other masters' works on the same verses. This is the only translation by Xuanzang that is not a direct translation of a text, but instead a selective and evaluative editorial drawing on ten distinct texts. Since Kuiji aligned himself with this text as assuming the role of Xuanzang's successor, the East Asian tradition has treated the Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra as the pivotal exemplar of Xuanzang's teachings.
In both style and content, the Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra symbolizes a superior advance over the earlier Lankavatara Sutra, a basic Faxiang School's canonical text that sets forth quite a few hallmarks of Mahayana position, such as the eight consciousnesses and the tathagatagarbha (Womb of the Buddha-to-be). Instead of bearing the latter's cryptically aphoristic form, Xuanzang's treatise is a detailed and coherent analysis, a scholastic apologetics on the doctrine of Consciousness-only. Without any reference to the tathagatagarbha itself, the Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra firmly grounds its pan-consciousness upon Absolute Suchness or the existence of the mind as true reality. Aside from human consciousness, another principle is accepted as real -- the so-called suchness, which is the equivalent of the void of the Madhyamika School.

The Vijnaptimatratasiddhi-sastra spells out how there can be a common empirical world for different individuals who ideate or construct particular objects, and who possess distinct bodies and sensory systems. According to Xuanzang, the universal "seeds" in the store consciousness account for the common appearance of things, while particular "seeds" make a description of the differences.

f. Faxiang Doctrines

Being a first and foremost idealistic school of Mahayana Buddhism, the Faxiang School categorically discerns chimerical phenomena manifested in consistent patterns of regularity and continuity; in order to justify this order in which only defiled elements could prevail before enlightenment is attained, it created the tenet of the alaya-vijnana. Sense perceptions are commanded as regular and coherent by a store of consciousnesses, of which one is consciously unaware. Then, sense impressions produce certain configurations in this insensibility that "perfumate" later impressions so that they appear consistent and regular. Each and every single one of beings possesses this seed consciousness, which therefore becomes a sort of collective consciousness that takes control of human perceptions of the world, though this world does not exist at all according to the very tenet. This school's forerunner had emerged in India roughly the second century AD, yet had its period of greatest productivity in the fourth century, during the time of Asanga and Vasubandha. Following them, the school divided into two branches, the Nyayanusarino Vijnanavadinah (Vijnanavada School of the Logical Tradition) and the Agamanusarino Vijnanavadinah (Vijnanavada School of the Scriptural Tradition), with the former sub-school postulating the standpoints of the logician Dignaga (c. AD 480-540) and his successor, Dharmakirti (c. AD 600?-680?).

This consciousness-oriented school of ideology was largely represented in China by the Faxiang School, called Popsang in Korea, and Hosso in Japan. The radical teachings of Yogacara became known in China primarily through a work of Paramartha, a sixth-century Indian missionary-translator. His rendition of the Mahayana-samparigraha-sastra (Compendium of the Great Vehicle) by Asanga provided a sound base for the Sanlun (Three-Treatise) School, which preceded the Faxiang School as the vehicle of Yogacara thought in China. Faxiang is the Chinese translation of the Sanskrit term dharmalaksana (characteristic of dharma), referring to the school's basal emphasis on the unique characteristics of the dharmas that make up the world, which appears in human ideation. According to Faxiang doctrines, there are five categories of dharmas: (1) eight mental dharmas, encompassing the five sense consciousnesses, cognition, the cognitive faculty, and the store consciousness; (2) eleven elements relating to appearances or material forms; (3) fifty-one mental capacities or functions, activities, and dispositions; (4) twenty-four situations, processes, and things not associated with the mind -- for example, time and becoming; and (5) six non-conditioned or non-created elements -- for instance, space and the nature of existence.

Alaya-consciousness is posited as the receptacle of the imprint of thoughts and deeds, thus it is the dwelling of sundry karmic seeds. These "germs" develop into form, feeling, perception, impulse, and consciousness, collectively known as the Five Aggregates. Then ideation gradually takes shape, which triggers off a self or mind against an outer world. Finally comes the awareness of the objects of thought via sense perceptions and ideas. The store consciousness must be purified of its subject-object duality and notions of false existence, and restored to its pure state tantamount to buddhahood, the Absolute Suchness, and the undifferentiated. In line with these three elements of false imagination, right knowledge, and suchness is the three modes in which things respectively are: (1) the mere fictions of false imagination; (2) under certain conditions to relatively exist; and (3) in the perfect mode of being. Corresponding to this threefold version of the modes of existence is the tri-body doctrine of the Buddha -- the Dharma Body, the Reward Body, and the Response Body, a creed that was put into its systematic and highly developed theory by Yogacara thinkers. The distinguishing features of the Faxiang School lie in its highlight of meditation and broadly psychological analyses. Seen in this light, it is a fry cry from the other predominant Mahayana stream, Madhyamika, where the stress is entirely upon dialectics and logical arguments.

The base consciousness is interpreted as the container of the karmic impressions or seeds, nourished by us beings in the process of our existence. These seeds, ripening in the course of future circumstances, find the nearest parallel to the present-day understanding of genes. In view of the foregoing, philosophers of this school have constantly essayed to explain in detail how karmic force actually operates and affects us on a concrete, personal level. Comprised in this development of consciousness theory is the concept of conscious justification -- phenomena that are presumably external to us can never exist but in intimate association with consciousness itself. Such a notion is commonly referred to as "Mind Only."

The fundamental early canonical texts that expound Yogacara doctrines are such scriptures as the (Sutra on Understanding Profound and Esoteric Doctrine, the Srimala-sutra (Sutra on the Lion's Roar of Queen Srimala), and treatises like the Mahayana-samparigraha-sastra, the Prakaranaryavaca-sastra (Acclamation of the Scriptural Teaching), and the Yogacarabhumi, etc.

5. Conclusion

As an early and influential Chinese Buddhist monk, Xuanzang embodies the tensions inherent in Chinese Buddhism: filial piety versus monastic discipline, Confucian orthodoxy versus Mahayana progressivism, etc. Such tensions can be seen not only in his personal legacies, which include the extremely popular Chinese novel based on his travels, Xiyouji (Journey to the West), but also in the career of scholastic Buddhism in China.

For a time during the middle of the Tang Dynasty the Faxiang School achieved a high degree of eminence and popularity across China, but after the passing of Xuanzang and Kuiji the school swiftly declined. One of the factors resulting in this decadence was the anti-Buddhist imperial persecutions of 845. Another likely factor was the harsh criticism of Faxiang by members of the Huayan (Hua-yen) School. In addition, the philosophy of this school, with its abstruse terminology and hairsplitting analysis of the mind and the senses, was too alien to be accepted by the practical-minded Chinese.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bapat, P. V., and K. A. Nilakanta Sastri, eds. 2500 Years of Buddhism. Delhi: Government of India Press, 1964.
  • Bernstein, Richard. Ultimate Journey: Retracing the Path of an Ancient Buddhist Monk Who Crossed Asia in Search of Enlightenment: Alfred A. Knopf, 2001.
  • Brown, Brian Edward. The Buddha Nature: A Study of the Tathagatagarbha and Alayavijnana. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1991.
  • Ch'en, Kenneth K. S. Buddhism in China: A Historical Survey. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1973.
  • Chatterjee, Ashok Kumar. The Yogacara Idealism. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1987.
  • The Unknown Hsuan-Tsang. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001.Edkins, Joseph. Chinese Buddhism: A Volume of Sketches, Historical, Descriptive and Critical. San Francisco: Chinese Materials Center, 1976.
  • Grousset, Rene. In the Footsteps of the Buddha. San Francisco: Chinese Materials Center, 1976.
  • Hwui Li. The life of Hiuen-Tsiang. London: Kegan Paul, Trench, and Trubner, 1911.
  • Kieschnick, John. The Eminent Monk: Buddhist Ideals in Medieval Chinese Hagiography. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1997.
  • Lan Ji-fu, ed. The Chung-hwa Fo Jian Bai Ke Quan Shu: Religious Affairs Committee of Foguangshan Buddhist Order, 1993.
  • Lusthaus, Dan. Buddhist Phenomenology: A Philosophical Investigation of Yogacara Buddhism and the Ch'eng Wei-shih lun. London: Routledge Curzon, 2002.
  • Nagao, Gadjin M. Madhyamika and Yogacara: A Study of Mahayana Philosophies. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1991.
  • Pachow, W. Chinese Buddhism: Aspects of Interaction and Reinterpretation. Lanham, MD: University Press of America, 1980.
  • Sharf, Robert H. Coming to Terms with Chinese Buddhism: A Reading of the Treasure Store Treatise. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 2002.
  • Waley, Arthur. The Real Tripitaka, and Other Pieces. London: George Allen & Unwin, 1952.
  • Watters, Thomas. On Yuan Chwang's Travels in India: A. D. 629-645. Delhi: Munshiram Manoharlal, 1996.
  • William, Paul, Mahayana Buddhism (The Doctrinal Foundations). London: Routledge, 1991.
  • Wriggins, Sally Hovey. Xuanzang: A Buddhist Pilgrim on the Silk Road. Boulder: Westview Press, 1996.

Author Information

Der Huey Lee
Peking University

Xunzi (Hsün Tzu, c. 310—c. 220 B.C.E.)

xunziXunzi, along with Confucius and Mencius, was one of the three great early architects of Confucian philosophy. In many ways, he offers a more complete and sophisticated defense of Confucianism than Mencius. Xunzi lived toward the end of the Warring States period (453-221 BCE), generally regarded as the formative era for most later Chinese philosophy. It was a time of great variety of thought, comparable to classical Greece, so Xunzi was acquainted with many competing ideas. In reaction to some of the other thinkers of the time, he articulated a systematic version of Confucianism that encompasses ethics, metaphysics, political theory, philosophy of language, and a highly developed philosophy of education. Xunzi is known for his belief that ritual is crucial for reforming humanity’s original nature. Human nature lacks an innate moral compass, and left to itself falls into contention and disorder, which is why Xunzi characterizes human nature as bad. Ritual is thus an integral part of a stable society. He focused on humanity's part in creating the roles and practices of an orderly society, and gave a much smaller role to Heaven or Nature as a source of order or morality than most other thinkers of the time. Although his thought was later considered to be outside of Confucian orthodoxy, it was still very influential in China and remains a source of interest today. (See Romanization systems for Chinese terms.)

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. The Way and Heaven
  3. Human Nature, Education, and the Ethical Ideal
    1. Human Nature
    2. Education
    3. The Ethical Ideal
    4. Discovering the Way
    5. The Heart
  4. Logic and Language
  5. Social and Political Thought
    1. Government structure
    2. Ritual and Music
    3. Moral Power
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Xunzi ("Master Xun") is the common appellation for the philosopher whose full name was Xun Kuang. He is also known as Xun Qing, “Minister Xun,” after an office he held. He was born in the state of Zhao in north-central China around 310 BCE. As a young man he studied in the state of Qi in the northeast, which had the greatest concentration of philosophers of the age. Xunzi's writings show him to be well acquainted with all the doctrines current at the time, which he probably came in contact with during this period of his life. Leaving Qi, he traveled to many of the other states that made up China at the time, and was briefly employed by some of them. His last post ended when his patron was assassinated in 238 BCE, ending his chances to put his theories of government into practice. Xunzi may have lived to see China unified by the authoritarian state of Qin in 221 BCE. If so, he certainly must have been disappointed that two of his former students, Li Si and Han Feizi, helped counsel Qin to victory when the Qin government was steadfastly opposed to Xunzi’s ideas of government through moral power. The Qin dynasty was long remembered as a time of strict laws and draconian punishments, and Xunzi’s association with two of its architects probably was one factor in the later marginalization of his thought.

Like most philosophical works of the time, the Xunzi that we have today is a later compilation of writings associated with him, not all of which were necessarily written by Xunzi himself. The current version of the Xunzi is divided into thirty-two books, about twenty-five of which are considered mostly or wholly authentic and others of which are considered representative of his thought, if not his actual writings. This is probably the largest collection of early Chinese philosophical writings that can be plausibly attributed to one author. The Xunzi is also notable for its style. Comparatively little of it is written in the dialogue format of works like the Mencius, and there are none of the fanciful parables of the Zhuangzi. Most books normally attributed to Xunzi are sustained essays on one topic that appear to have be written as more or less unified pieces, though there are often sections of verse and two books that are merely compilations of poetry. In these writings, Xunzi carefully defines his own position and raises objections to rival thinkers in a way that renders his work more recognizable as philosophy than that of many other early Chinese thinkers.

2. The Way and Heaven

The most important concept in Xunzi's philosophy is the Way (dao). This is one of the most common terms of Chinese philosophy, though all thinkers define it somewhat differently. Though the term originally referred to a road or path, it became extended to a way of doing things, a way of acting, or as it was used in philosophy, the right way to live. In Xunzi’s case, he means the human way, the way of good government and the proper way of behaving, not the Way of Heaven or Nature as Laozi and Zhuangzi define it, and as Mencius often suggests. In fact, Xunzi is notable for having probably the most rationalistic view of Heaven and the supernatural in the early period. Xunzi claims that the Way was first pointed out by particularly wise and gifted people he calls sages (a common term for an exemplar in early Chinese thought), and following the Way as it has been handed down from the past will result in a stable, prosperous, peaceful society, while going against it will have the opposite results. While certain aspects of the Way, such as particular rituals, are certainly created by humanity, whether the Way as a whole is created or discovered remains a matter of scholarly debate.

Unlike many other early philosophers, Xunzi does not believe Heaven gets involved in human affairs. Heaven was sometimes considered to be an anthropomorphic god, sometimes an impersonal force that automatically rewarded the good and punished the bad, but in Xunzi's view Heaven is much like Nature: it acts as it always does, neither helping the good or harming the bad. The Way is not the Way because Heaven approves of it, it is the Way because it is good for people. In the chapter "Discourse on Heaven" (chapter 17, also translated as “Discourse on Nature”), Xunzi devotes himself to refuting these other views of Heaven, most prominently that of the Mohists. Heaven does not reward good kings with peace and prosperity, nor punish tyrants by having them deposed. These results come about through their own good or bad decisions. Having a good harvest and sufficient food is not a sign of Heaven’s favor, it is the result of wise agricultural policy. Similarly, events like eclipses and floods are not signs of Heaven’s displeasure: they are simply things that sometimes happen. One might wonder at them as unusual occurrences, but it is not right to be afraid of them or consider them ominous. Worrying about Heaven’s favor is a waste of time; it is better to be prepared for whatever might happen. There will be some natural disasters, but if one is prepared they will not cause harm.

Interestingly, though Xunzi has this rational view of Nature, which extends to spirits and gods as well, he never suggests eliminating religious rituals that are directed toward them, such as sacrifices and divination. One must perform them as part of the ritual system that binds society together, but one does not perform expecting any results. In "Discourse on Heaven," Xunzi wrote, “You pray for rain and it rains. Why? For no particular reason, I say. It is just as though you had not prayed for rain and it rained anyway.” When it rains after you pray for rain, it is just like when it rains when you didn't pray for it. Yet during a drought, officials must still pray for rain—not because it has any effect on the natural world, but because of its effect on people. What Xunzi believes ritual does will be examined later.

In Xunzi's view, the best thing to do is understand what Nature does and what humanity does, and concentrate on the latter. Not only is it wrong to believe that Heaven intervenes in human affairs, it is useless to speculate about why Nature is the way it is or to try to help it along. Xunzi is interested in practical knowledge, and speculation about Nature is not useful. In this respect, he could be considered anti-metaphysical, since he has no interest in how the world works or what it is. His concern is what people should do, and anything that might confuse or detract from that is a waste of time. We know that Nature is invariable, and we know the Way to get what we need from Nature to live, and that is all we need to know. This kind of division between knowledge of the human world and knowledge of Heaven may have been partially influenced by Zhuangzi, but while Zhuangzi considers knowing Heaven to be important, Xunzi does not.

3. Human Nature, Education, and the Ethical Ideal

a. Human Nature

As Mencius is known for the slogan "human nature is good," Xunzi is known for its opposite, “human nature is bad.” Mencius viewed self-cultivation as developing natural tendencies within us. Xunzi believes that our natural tendencies lead to conflict and disorder, and what we need to do is radically reform them, not develop them. Both shared an optimism about human perfectability, but they viewed the process quite differently. Xunzi envisioned that humanity was once in a state of nature reminiscent of Hobbes. Without study of the Way, people's desires will run rampant, and they will inevitably find themselves in conflict in trying to satisfy their desires. Left to themselves, people will fall into disorder, poverty and conflict, living a life that would be, as Hobbes put it, “poor, nasty, brutish, and short.” It was this insistence that human nature is bad that was most often condemned by later thinkers, who rejected Xunzi’s view in favor of the idea, traced to Mencius, that people are naturally good.

Xunzi offers several arguments against Mencius's position. He defines human nature as what is inborn and does not need to be learned. He argues that if people were good by nature, there would be no need for ritual and social norms. The sages would not have had to create them, and they would not need to have been handed down through the generations. They were created precisely because people do not act in accordance with them naturally. He also notes that people desire the good, and on the principle that one desires what one doesn’t already have, this shows that people are not good. He gives several illustrations of what life is like in the state of nature, without any education on ritual and morality. Xunzi does not believe that people are evil, that they deliberately violate the rules of morality, taking a perverse pleasure in doing so. They have no natural conception of morality at all: they are morally blind by nature. Their desires bring them into conflict because they don’t know any better, not because they enjoy conflict. In fact, Xunzi believes people do not enjoy it at all, which is why they desire the kind of life that results from good order brought about through the rituals of the sages.

Like Mencius, Xunzi believed human nature is the same in everyone: no one starts off with moral principles. The original nature of Yao (a legendary sage king) and Jie (a legendary tyrant) was the same. The difference was in how they cultivated themselves. Yao reformed his original nature, Jie did not. In this way, Xunzi emphasizes the essential perfectability of everyone. Human nature is bad, but it is not incorrigible, and in fact Xunzi was rather optimistic about the possibility of overcoming the demands of desires that result in the state of nature. Though Confucius suggests that some people are better off by nature than others, Mencius and Xunzi seem to agree that everyone starts out the same, though they differ on the content of that original state. Though Xunzi believes that it is always possible to reform oneself, he recognizes that in reality this will not always happen. In most cases, the individual himself has to make the first step in attempting to reform, and Xunzi is rather pessimistic about people actually doing this. They cannot be forced to do so, and they may in practice be unable to make the choice to improve, but for Xunzi, this does not mean that in principle it is impossible for them to change.

b. Education

Like Confucius and Mencius, Xunzi is much more concerned with what kind of person to be than with rules of moral behavior or duty, and in this respect his view is similar to Western virtue ethics. The goal of Xunzi's ethics is to become a person who knows and acts according to the Way as if it were second nature. Because human nature is bad, Xunzi emphasizes the importance of study to learn the Way. He compares the process of reforming one’s nature to making a pot out of clay or straightening wood with a press-frame. Without the potter, the clay would never become a pot on its own. Similarly, people will not be able to reform their nature without a teacher showing them what to do. Xunzi’s concern is primarily moral education; he wants people to develop into good people, not people who know a lot of facts. He emphasizes the transformative aspect of education, where it changes one’s basic nature. Xunzi laid out a program of study based on the works of the sages of the past that would teach proper ritual behavior and develop moral principles. He was the first to offer an organized Confucian curriculum, and his curriculum became the blueprint for traditional education in China until the modern period.

Practice was an important aspect of Xunzi's course of education. A student did not simply study ritual, he performed it. Xunzi recognized that this performative aspect was crucial to the goal of transforming one’s nature. It was only through practice that one could realize the beauty of ritual, ideally coming to appreciate it for itself. Though this was the end of education, Xunzi appealed to more utilitarian motives to start the student on the program of study. As noted above, he discussed how desires would inevitably be frustrated in the state of nature. Organizing society through ritual was the only way people could ever satisfy even some of their desires, and study of ritual was the best way to achieve satisfaction on a personal level. Through study and practice, one could learn to appreciate ritual for its own sake, not just as a means to satisfy desires. Ritual has this power to transform someone’s motives and character. The beginning student of ritual is like a child learning to play the piano. Maybe she doesn’t enjoy playing the piano at first, but her parents take her out for ice cream after each lesson, so she goes along with it because she gets what she wants. After years of study and practice, she might learn to appreciate playing the piano for its own sake, and will practice even without any reward. This is what Xunzi imagines will happen to the dedicated student of ritual: he starts out studying ritual as a means, but it becomes an end in itself as part of the Way.

c. The Ethical Ideal

Xunzi often distinguishes three stages of progress in study: the scholar, the gentlemen, and the sage, though sometimes the sage and the gentleman seem to be equivalent for him. These were all terms in common use in philosophical discourse of the time, especially in Confucian thought, but Xunzi gives them a unique twist. He describes the achievements of each stage slightly differently in several places, but what he seems to mean is that a scholar is someone who has taken the first step of wishing to study the Way of the ancient sages and adopts them as the model for correct conduct; the gentleman has acquired a good deal of learning, but still must think about what the right thing to do is in a situation; and the sage has wholly internalized the principles of ritual and morality so that his action flows spontaneously without the need for thought, yet never goes beyond the bounds of what is proper. Using the piano analogy, the scholar has made up his mind to study the piano and is practicing basic scales. The gentleman is fairly skilled, but still needs to look at the music in front of him to know what to play. The sage is like a concert pianist who not only plays with perfect technique, but also adds his own style and unique interpretation of the music, accomplishing all this without ever consciously thinking about what notes to play. As the pianist is still playing someone else's music, the sage does not make up new standards of conduct; he still follows the Way, but he makes it his own. Yet even then, at this highest stage, Xunzi believes there is still room for learning. Study is a lifelong process that only ends at death, much as concert pianists must still practice to maintain their skills.

The teacher plays an extremely important role in the course of study. A good teacher does not simply know the rituals, he embodies them and practices them in his own life. Just as one would not learn piano from someone who had just read a book on piano pedagogy but never touched an actual instrument, one should not study from someone who has only learned texts. A teacher is not just a source of information; he is a model for the student to look up to and a source of inspiration of what to become. A teacher who does not live up to the Way of the sages in his own life is no teacher at all. Xunzi believes there is no better method of study than learning from such a teacher. In this way, the student has a model before of him of how to live ritual principles, so his learning does not become simple accumulation of facts. In the event that such a teacher is unavailable, the next best method is to honor ritual principles sincerely, trying to embody them in oneself. Without either of these methods, Xunzi believes learning degenerates into memorizing a jumble of facts with no impact on one's conduct.

d. Discovering the Way

Given Xunzi's insistence on the importance of teachers to transmit the Way of the sages of the past and his belief that people are all bad by nature, he must face the question of how the first sages discovered the Way. Xunzi uses the metaphor of a river ford for the true Way: without the people who have gone before to leave markers, those coming after would have no way of knowing where the deep places are, and they would be in danger of drowning. The question is, how did the first people get across safely, when there were no markers? Xunzi does not address the question in precisely this way, but we can piece together an answer from his writings.

Examining the analogies Xunzi uses is instructive here. He talks about cultivating moral principles as a process of crafting, using the metaphors of a potter shaping and firing clay into a pot, or using a press-frame to straighten a bent piece of wood. Just as the skill of making pottery was undoubtedly accumulated through generations of refining, Xunzi appears to think that the Way of the sages was also a product of generations of development. According to Xunzi's definition of human nature, no one could say people know how to make pots by nature: this is not something we can do without study and practice, like walking and talking are. Nevertheless, some people, through a combination of perseverance, talent, and luck, were able to discover how to make pots, and then taught that skill to others. Similarly, through generations of observing humanity and trying different ways of regulating society, the sages hit upon the correct Way, the best way to order society in Xunzi’s view. David Nivison has suggested that different sages of the past contributed different aspects of the Way: some discovered agriculture, some discovered fire, some discovered the principles of filiality and respect between husband and wife, and so on.

Xunzi views these achievements as products of the sage's acquired nature, not his original nature. This is another way of saying these are not products of people’s natural tendencies, but the results of study and experimentation. Accumulation of effort is an important concept for Xunzi. The Way of the sages was created through accumulation of learning what worked and benefited society. The sages built on the accomplishments of previous sages, added their own contributions, and now Xunzi believes the process is basically complete: we know the ritual principles that will produce a harmonious society. Trying to govern or become a moral person without studying the sages of the past is essentially trying to re-invent the wheel, or discover how to make pots on one’s own without learning from a potter. It is conceivable (though Xunzi is very skeptical about anyone actually being able to do it), but it is much more difficult and time-consuming, when all one has to do is study what has already been created.

e. The Heart

In addition to having a teacher, a critical requirement for study is having the proper frame of mind, or more precisely, heart, since early Chinese thought considered cognition to be located in the heart. Xunzi's philosophy of the heart draws from other contemporary views as well as Confucian philosophy. Like Mencius, Xunzi believed that the heart should be the lord of the body, and using the heart to direct desires and decide on right and wrong accords with the Way. However, like Zhuangzi, Xunzi emphasizes that the heart must be tranquil and concentrated to be able to learn. In the view of the heart basically shared by Xunzi and Mencius, desires are not wholly voluntary. Desires are part of human nature, and can be activated without our necessarily being conscious of them. The function of the heart is to regulate the sense faculties and parts of the body, so that though one may have desires, the heart only acts on those desires when it is right to do so. The heart controls itself and directs the other parts of the body. This ability of the heart is what allows humanity to create ritual and moral principles and escape the state of nature.

In the chapter "Dispelling Blindness" Xunzi discusses the right way to develop the heart to avoid falling into error. For study, the heart needs to be trained to be receptive, focused, and calm. These qualities of the heart allow it to know the Way, and knowing the Way, the heart can realize the benefits of the Way and practice it. This receptivity Xunzi calls emptiness, meaning the ability of the heart to continually store new information without becoming full. Focus is called unity, by which Xunzi means the ability to be aware of two aspects of a thing or situation without allowing them to interfere with each other. “Being of two hearts” was a common problem in Chinese philosophical writings: it could mean being confused or perplexed about something, as well as what we would call being two-faced. Xunzi addresses the first aspect with his discussion of unity, a focus that keeps the heart directed and free from perplexity. The final quality the heart needs is stillness, the quality of moving freely from task to task without disorder, remaining unperturbed while processing new information. A heart that has the qualities of emptiness, unity, and stillness can understand the Way. Without these qualities, the heart is liable to fall into various kinds of “blindness” or obsessions that Xunzi attributes to his philosophical rivals. Their hearts focus too much on just one aspect of the Way, so they are unable to see the big picture. They become obsessed with this one part and mistake it for the entirety of the Way. Only with the proper attitudes and control of one's heart can one perceive and grasp the Way as a whole.

4. Logic and Language

One subject that was certainly not part of Xunzi's program of study is logic. Other philosophers, particularly the Mohist school, were developing sophisticated views on logic and the principles of argumentation around Xunzi’s time, and other thinkers were known for their paradoxes that played with language to show its limits. Though Xunzi was undoubtedly influenced by the principles of argument developed by the Mohists, he had no patience for the dialectical games and disputation for its own sake that were popular at the time. According to one story, a philosopher, having just convinced a king through his arguments, then took the other side and persuaded the king that his earlier arguments were wrong. Such exercises in argument and rhetoric were a waste of time for Xunzi; the only correct use of argument was to convince someone of the truth. Even the work of trying to distinguish logical categories was not productive in his view. According to Xunzi, such work can accomplish something, but it is still not the province of the gentlemen, much as wondering about the workings of nature are not the gentlemen’s concern, either. The only proper object of study is the Way of the sages; anything else is at best useless and at worst detrimental to the Way.

Despite his professed disinterest in logic, Xunzi came up with the most detailed philosophy of language in early Confucian thought. Again, however, his primary concern was preserving the Way in the face of attacks, which in Xunzi's view included questions about the nature of language that were arising at the time. He defended a modified conventionalism concerning language: names were not intrinsically appropriate for the objects they referred to, but once usage was determined by convention, to depart from it is wrong. It would be a mistake to think of Xunzi’s view as a kind of nominalism, however, since he is very clear that there is an objective reality that names refer to. The particular phonemes used to make the word "cat" in language are conventionally determined, but the fact that a cat is a kind of feline is real. One of the fundamental principles of Confucianism was that the reality must match the name. Confucian thinkers were most concerned about the names of social roles: a father must act like a father should, a ruler must act like a ruler should. Not fulfilling the demands of one’s role means that one does not deserve the title, hence Mencius defined the removal of a tyrant as the killing of a commoner, not regicide. Xunzi defended this view, yet he objected to the Mohists, who claimed that a robber is not a person, so that killing a robber is not killing a person. This kind of usage violated the principles of correct naming and departed from the Way, though Xunzi is not entirely clear why. In Xunzi’s view, the reality represented by a name is objective, even if the name is merely conventional. Because of the objectivity of referent, he distinguishes appropriate (following convention) and inappropriate (violating convention) uses of names. In addition, he believes there are good and bad names. Good names are simple and direct and readily bring the referent to mind. Using names in a way that the referents are clear is using names correctly. The chief function of language is to communicate, and anything that interferes with communication, such as the word games and paradoxes of other philosophers, should be eliminated.

5. Social and Political Thought

a. Government structure

The Warring States period, during which Xunzi lived, was a time of great social change and instability. As the name implies, it was a period of disunity, when several different states were warring with each other to determine who would gain control of all of China and found a new dynasty. Under the pressure of competition, the old ways and political systems were being abandoned in the search for greater control over human and material resources and increased military power. The central question for most philosophers of the time was how to respond to this time of instability and achieve a greater measure of order and safety. For the Confucian philosophers, the answer was found in a revival of the ways of the past, and for Xunzi in particular, the most important aspect of that was the ritual system. In this sense, the ethical and political aspects of Xunzi's philosophy are the core areas, and in fact were not sharply distinguished in most Confucian thought. Metaphysics and philosophy of language serve to further the goal of restoring social stability.

All of the Warring States philosophers assumed that the government should be a monarchy. The king was the ultimate authority in all areas of government, having full power to hire and dismiss (and execute) any other government official. There was no idea of democracy in early China. The ruler could lose his state through failing in his duties as a sovereign, but he could not be replaced at the whim of the people. The political thinkers of the time instead tried to impose checks through tradition and thought, rather than law. The Mohists made Heaven the watchdog over the ruler: if a ruler offended Heaven by mistreating the people, Heaven would have him removed through war or revolt. The Confucians also emphasized the duties of the ruler to the people, though in Xunzi's case there was no personified Heaven watching over things. One of the functions of ritual was to try to put limits on the power of the ruler and emphasize his obligation to the people. Confucian thinkers, including Xunzi often viewed the state as a family. Just as a father must take care of his children, the ruler must take care of the people, and in return, the people will respond with loyalty. The Confucians also offered a very practical motive to care for the people: if the people were dissatisfied with the ruler, they would not fight on his behalf, and the state would be ripe for annexation by its neighbors.

b. Ritual and Music

Xunzi diagnosed the main cause of disorder as a breakdown of the social hierarchy. When hierarchical distinctions are confused and people do not follow their proper roles, they compete indiscriminately to satisfy their desires. The way to put limits on this competition is to clarify social distinctions: such as between ruler and subject, between older brother and younger brother, or between men and women. When everyone knows their place and what obligations and privileges they have, they will not contend for goods beyond their status. Not only will this result in order and stability, it actually will allow for greater satisfaction of everyone's desires than the competition of the state of nature. This is the primary purpose of ritual: to clarify and enforce social distinctions, which will bring an end to contention for limited resources and improve social order. This, in turn, will ensure greater prosperity. The ritual tradition not only emphasized reciprocal obligations between people of different status, it had extremely precise regulations concerning who was allowed to own what kind of luxuries. There were rules concerning what colors of clothing different people could wear, who was allowed to ride in carriages, and what grave goods they could be buried with. The point of all these rules is to enforce the distinctions necessary for social harmony and prevent people from reaching beyond their station.

Without the benefit of ritual principles to enforce the social hierarchy, the identity of human nature makes conflict inevitable. By nature we all desire the same things: fine food, beautiful clothing, wealth, and comfort. Xunzi believes desires are inevitable. When most people see something beautiful, they will desire it: only the sage can control his desires. Because of limited resources, it is impossible for everyone to satisfy their desires for material goods. What people can do is decide whether to act on a desire or not. Ritual teaches people to channel, moderate, and in some cases transform their desires so they can satisfy them in appropriate ways. When it is right to do so one satisfies them, and when that is not possible one moderates them. This allows both the partial satisfaction of desires and the maintenance of social harmony. All of this is made possible by the ritual principles of the Way, when the alternative is the chaos of the state of nature. Hence, Xunzi wrote that Confucian teachings allow people to satisfy both the demands of ritual and their desires, when the alternative is satisfying neither.

Another important part of governing is music. The ancient Chinese believed that music was the most direct and effective way of influencing the emotions. Hence, only allowing the correct music to be played was crucial to governing the state. The right kinds of music, those attributed to the ancient sages, could both give people an outlet for emotions that could not be satisfied in other ways, like aggression, and channel their emotions and bring them in line with the Way. The wrong kind of music would instead encourage wanton, destructive behavior and cause a breakdown of social order. Because of its powerful effect on the emotions, music is as important a tool as ritual in moral education and in governing. Much as Plato suggested in the Republic, Xunzi believes regulating music is one of the duties of the state. It must promulgate the correct music to give people a legitimate source of emotional expression and ban unorthodox music to prevent it from upsetting the balance of society.

c. Moral Power

As he does with virtuous people, Xunzi distinguishes different levels of rulers. The lowest is the ruler who relies on military power to expand his territory, taxes excessively without regard for whether his people have enough to sustain themselves, and keeps them in line with laws and punishments. According to Xunzi, such a ruler is sure to come to a bad end. A ruler who governs efficiently, does not tax the people too harshly, gathers people of ability around him, and makes allies of the neighboring states can become a hegemon. The institution of the hegemon existed briefly about three hundred years before Xunzi's time, but he often uses the term to connote an effective ruler who is still short of the highest level. The highest level is that of the true king who wins the hearts of the people through his rule by ritual principles. The moral power of the true king is so great that he can unify the whole country without a single battle, since the people will come to him of their own accord to live under his beneficent rule. According to Xunzi, this is how the sage kings of the past were able to unify the country even though they began as rulers of small states. The best kind of government is government through the moral power acquired by following the Way.

This concept of moral power was quite old in China even in Xunzi's time, though initially it referred to the power gained from the spirits through sacrifice. Beginning with Confucius, it become ethicized into a kind of power or charisma that anyone who cultivated virtue and followed the Way developed. Through this moral power, a king could rule effectively without having to personally attend to the day-to-day business of governing. Following his example, the people would become virtuous as well, so crime would be minimal, and the ruler’s subordinates could carry out the necessary administrative tasks to run the state. In Confucian thought, the most important role of the ruler is that of moral example, which is why the best government was that of a sage who followed the ritual principles of the Way. Confucius seemed to believe that the moral power of a sage king would render laws and punishments completely unnecessary: the people would be transformed by the ruler’s moral power and never transgress the boundaries of what is right. Xunzi, while still believing in the efficacy of rule through moral force, is not quite as optimistic, which is likely related to his view on human nature. He thinks punishments will still be necessary because some people will break the law, but a sage king will only rarely need to employ punishments to keep the people in line, while a lord-protector or ordinary ruler will have to resort to them much more. This increased acceptance of the necessity for punishments may have influenced Xunzi’s student Han Feizi, to whom is attributed the most developed theory of government through a strict system of rewards and punishments that was employed by the short-lived Qin dynasty.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Cua, Antonio S. Ethical Argumentation: A Study in Hsün Tzu's Moral Epistemology. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 1985.
  • Dubs, Homer H. Hsüntze: Moulder of Ancient Confucianism. London: Arthur Probsthain, 1927. The first English-language monograph on Xunzi's thought.
  • Goldin, Paul. Rituals of the Way. Chicago: Open Court, 1999. A good overview of the essentials of Xunzi's thought.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip J. Confucian Moral Self Cultivation. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2000. An introduction to Confucian thought, focusing on the theme of self cultivation. Includes a chapter on Xunzi.
  • Kline, T.C. III and Philip J. Ivanhoe, eds. Virtue, Nature, and Moral Agency in the Xunzi. Indianapolis: Hackett, 2000. An excellent anthology bringing together much of the recent important work on Xunzi. The bibliography includes virtually every English publication related to Xunzi.
  • Knoblock, John, trans. Xunzi: A Translation and Study of the Complete Works, 3 vols. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1988, 1990, 1994. The only complete English translation of the Xunzi, with extensive introductory material.
  • Machle, Edward. Nature and Heaven in the Xunzi: A Study of the Tian Lun. Albany: SUNY Press, 1993. A translation and study of chapter seventeen, "Discourse on Heaven."
  • Watson, Burton, trans. Hsün Tzu: Basic Writings. New York: Columbia University Press, 1964. An excerpted translation, including many of the more philosophically interesting chapters. It is easier for non-specialists than Knoblock.

Author Information

David Elstein
State University of New York at New Paltz
U. S. A.

William Warburton (1698—1779)

WarburtonWilliam Warburton was Church of England bishop of Gloucester, born at Newark-upon- Trent (17 miles n.e. of Nottingham) on December 24, 1698. He died at Gloucester June 7, 1779. His father, an attorney, had him educated for the law, which he probably practiced 1719-23. Warburton always a passionate liking for theology, and was ordained deacon, 1723, and priest, 1727; he became rector-at Greaseley, Nottingham, 1726; was rector at Brant-Broughton, 1728- 30; and at Frisby, 1730-56; became chaplain to the Prince of Wales, 1735; preacher to Lincoln's Inn, 1746; chaplain to the king, 1754; prebendary of Durham, 1755; dean of Bristol, 1757; and bishop of Gloucester, 1760. As a critic Warburton had a reputation for being excessively sarcastic and abusive. In the retirement of country life during the earlier years of his activity he prosecuted his studies with great diligence, and wrote those works which have perpetuated his memory. The first of these was The Alliance between Church and State; or the Necessity and Equity of an established Religion, and a Test Law demonstrated, from the Essence and End of civil Society upon the fundamental Principles of the Laws of Nature and Nations (1736), in which, while taking high ground, as the title indicates, he yet maintains that the State Church should tolerate those who differed from it in doctrine and worship. Soon thereafter came his great work, The Divine Legation of Moses, Demonstrated on the Principles of a Religious Deist, from the Omission of the Doctrine of a Future State of Rewards and Punishments in the Jewish Dispensation. Books I.-III. appeared in vol. I. (1737-38); books IV., V., VI., in vol. II. (1741); books VII. and VIII. never appeared; book IX. was first published in his Works (1788; 10th ed. Of the entire work, ed. James Nichols, 3 vols., 1846). The treatise was directed against the Deists (see also Deism), especially their doctrine of the Old Testament and their stress upon the omission of mention of immorality in the Old Testament. Warburton turns the tables upon them by constructing, out of the very absence of such statements, a proof of the divinity of the Mosaic legislation.The first three books deal with the necessity of the doctrine of a future state of rewards and punishments to civil society from (1) the nature of the thing, (2) the conduct of the ancient lawgivers and founders of civil policy, and (3) the opinions and conduct of the ancient sages and philosophers. The fourth book proves the high antiquity of the arts and empire of Egypt, and that such high antiquity illustrates and confirms the truth of the Mosaic history. The fifth book explains the nature of the Jewish theocracy. In the sixth book Warburton shows from the Old and New Testaments that a future state of rewards and punishments did make part of the Mosaic dispensation. The ninth book treats of the true nature and genius of the Christian religion. The general argument is that because the sacred books of Judaism said nothing respecting a future state of rewards and punishments, it must be divine, since it did really accomplish the punishment of wrong-doers without such a doctrine, and no other legislation has been able to do so without it. This it could do because the foundation and support of the Mosaic legislation was the theocracy which was peculiar to the Jews, and dealt out in this life righteous rewards and punishments upon individual-and nation. An extraordinary providence conducted the affairs of this people, and consequently the sending of Moses was divinely ordered. The work is confessedly limited to one line of argument, is defective in exegesis, and does not do justice to the intimations of immortality among the later Jews; yet it is distinguished by freshness and vigor, masterly argumentation, and bold imagination. The excursuses are particularly admirable. His writings, besides those already noted, embrace a commentary upon Pope's Essay on Man (1742; by this he won Pope's firm friendship); Julian (1750; on the numerous alleged providential interferences which defeated Julian's attempt to rebuild the temple); Remarks on Mr. David Hume's Essay on The Natural History of Religion (1757); The Doctrine of Grace; or the Office and Operations of the Holy Spirit vindicated from the Insults of Infidelity and the Abuses of Fanaticism (2 vols., 1762; a work directed against the Methodists, which did not advanace his reputation). His Works were edited with a biographical preface by Bishop Hurd (7 vols., 1788; new ed., 12 vols., 1811; the expense was borne by Warburton's widow). Supplementary to this edition are the Tracts by Warburton and a Warburtonian (1789); Letters (Kidderminster, 1808; 2d ed., London, 1809); Selections from the Unpublished Papers of Warburton (1841).

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Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889—1951)

Ludwig WittgensteinLudwig Wittgenstein is one of the most influential philosophers of the twentieth century, and regarded by some as the most important since Immanuel Kant. His early work was influenced by that of Arthur Schopenhauer and, especially, by his teacher Bertrand Russell and by Gottlob Frege, who became something of a friend. This work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, the only philosophy book that Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. It claimed to solve all the major problems of philosophy and was held in especially high esteem by the anti-metaphysical logical positivists. The Tractatus is based on the idea that philosophical problems arise from misunderstandings of the logic of language, and it tries to show what this logic is. Wittgenstein's later work, principally his Philosophical Investigations, shares this concern with logic and language, but takes a different, less technical, approach to philosophical problems. This book helped to inspire so-called ordinary language philosophy. This style of doing philosophy has fallen somewhat out of favor, but Wittgenstein's work on rule-following and private language is still considered important, and his later philosophy is influential in a growing number of fields outside philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus
  3. Ethics and Religion
  4. Conception of Philosophy
  5. Meaning
  6. Rules and Private Language
  7. Realism and Anti-Realism
  8. Certainty
  9. Continuity
  10. Wittgenstein in History
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Wittgenstein’s Main Works
    2. Some Biographies of Wittgenstein
    3. Secondary Works

1. Life

Ludwig Josef Johann Wittgenstein, born on April 26th 1889 in Vienna, Austria, was a charismatic enigma. He has been something of a cult figure but shunned publicity and even built an isolated hut in Norway to live in complete seclusion. His sexuality was ambiguous but he was probably gay; how actively so is still a matter of controversy. His life seems to have been dominated by an obsession with moral and philosophical perfection, summed up in the subtitle of Ray Monk's excellent biography Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius.

His concern with moral perfection led Wittgenstein at one point to insist on confessing to several people various sins, including that of allowing others to underestimate the extent of his 'Jewishness'. His father Karl Wittgenstein's parents were born Jewish but converted to Protestantism and his mother Leopoldine (nee Kalmus) was Catholic, but her father was of Jewish descent. Wittgenstein himself was baptized in a Catholic church and was given a Catholic burial, although between baptism and burial he was neither a practicing nor a believing Catholic.

The Wittgenstein family was large and wealthy. Karl Wittgenstein was one of the most successful businessmen in the Austro-Hungarian Empire, leading the iron and steel industry there. The Wittgensteins' home attracted people of culture, especially musicians, including the composer Johannes Brahms, who was a friend of the family. Music remained important to Wittgenstein throughout his life. So did darker matters. Ludwig was the youngest of eight children, and of his four brothers, three committed suicide.

As for his career, Wittgenstein studied mechanical engineering in Berlin and in 1908 went to Manchester, England to do research in aeronautics, experimenting with kites. His interest in engineering led to an interest in mathematics which in turn got him thinking about philosophical questions about the foundations of mathematics. He visited the mathematician and philosopher Gottlob Frege (1848-1925), who recommended that he study with Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) in Cambridge. At Cambridge Wittgenstein greatly impressed Russell and G.E. Moore (1873- 1958), and began work on logic.

When his father died in 1913 Wittgenstein inherited a fortune, which he quickly gave away. When war broke out the next year, he volunteered for the Austrian army. He continued his philosophical work and won several medals for bravery during the war. The result of his thinking on logic was the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus which was eventually published in English in 1922 with Russell's help. This was the only book Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. Having thus, in his opinion, solved all the problems of philosophy, Wittgenstein became an elementary school teacher in rural Austria, where his approach was strict and unpopular, but apparently effective. He spent 1926-28 meticulously designing and building an austere house in Vienna for his sister Gretl.

In 1929 he returned to Cambridge to teach at Trinity College, recognizing that in fact he had more work to do in philosophy. He became professor of philosophy at Cambridge in 1939. During World War II he worked as a hospital porter in London and as a research technician in Newcastle. After the war he returned to university teaching but resigned his professorship in 1947 to concentrate on writing. Much of this he did in Ireland, preferring isolated rural places for his work. By 1949 he had written all the material that was published after his death as Philosophical Investigations, arguably his most important work. He spent the last two years of his life in Vienna, Oxford and Cambridge and kept working until he died of prostate cancer in Cambridge in April 1951. His work from these last years has been published as On Certainty. His last words were, "Tell them I've had a wonderful life."

2. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus

Wittgenstein told Ludwig von Ficker that the point of the Tractatus was ethical. In the preface to the book he says that its value consists in two things: "that thoughts are expressed in it" and "that it shows how little is achieved when these problems are solved." The problems he refers to are the problems of philosophy defined, we may suppose, by the work of Frege and Russell, and perhaps also Schopenhauer. At the end of the book Wittgenstein says "My propositions serve as elucidations in the following way: anyone who understands me eventually recognizes them as nonsensical" [emphasis added]. What to make of the Tractatus, its author, and the propositions it contains, then, is no easy matter.

The book certainly does not seem to be about ethics. It consists of numbered propositions in seven sets. Proposition 1.2 belongs to the first set and is a comment on proposition 1. Proposition 1.21 is about proposition 1.2, and so on. The seventh set contains only one proposition, the famous "What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence."

Some important and representative propositions from the book are these:

1 The world is all that is the case.
4.01 A proposition is a picture of reality.
4.0312 ...My fundamental idea is that the 'logical constants' are not representatives; that there can be no representatives of the logic of facts.
4.121 ...Propositions show the logical form of reality. They display it.
4.1212 What can be shown, cannot be said.
4.5 ...The general form of a proposition is: This is how things stand.
5.43 ...all the propositions of logic say the same thing, to wit nothing.
5.4711 To give the essence of a proposition means to give the essence of all description, and thus the essence of the world.
5.6 The limits of my language mean the limits of my world.

Here and elsewhere in the Tractatus Wittgenstein seems to be saying that the essence of the world and of life is: This is how things are. One is tempted to add "--deal with it." That seems to fit what Cora Diamond has called his "accept and endure" ethics, but he says that the propositions of the Tractatus are meaningless, not profound insights, ethical or otherwise. What are we to make of this?

Many commentators ignore or dismiss what Wittgenstein said about his work and its aims, and instead look for regular philosophical theories in his work. The most famous of these in the Tractatus is the "picture theory" of meaning. According to this theory propositions are meaningful insofar as they picture states of affairs or matters of empirical fact. Anything normative, supernatural or (one might say) metaphysical must, it therefore seems, be nonsense. This has been an influential reading of parts of the Tractatus. Unfortunately, this reading leads to serious problems since by its own lights the Tractatus' use of words like "object," "reality" and "world" is illegitimate. These concepts are purely formal or a priori. A statement such as "There are objects in the world" does not picture a state of affairs. Rather it is, as it were, presupposed by the notion of a state of affairs. The "picture theory" therefore denies sense to just the kind of statements of which the Tractatus is composed, to the framework supporting the picture theory itself. In this way the Tractatus pulls the rug out from under its own feet.

If the propositions of the Tractatus are nonsensical then they surely cannot put forward the picture theory of meaning, or any other theory. Nonsense is nonsense. However, this is not to say that the Tractatus itself is without value. Wittgenstein's aim seems to have been to show up as nonsense the things that philosophers (himself included) are tempted to say. Philosophical theories, he suggests, are attempts to answer questions that are not really questions at all (they are nonsense), or to solve problems that are not really problems. He says in proposition 4.003 that:

Most of the propositions and questions of philosophers arise from our failure to understand the logic of our language. (They belong to the same class as the question whether the good is more or less identical than the beautiful.) And it is not surprising that the deepest problems are in fact not problems at all.

Philosophers, then, have the task of presenting the logic of our language clearly. This will not solve important problems but it will show that some things that we take to be important problems are really not problems at all. The gain is not wisdom but an absence of confusion. This is not a rejection of philosophy or logic. Wittgenstein took philosophical puzzlement very seriously indeed, but he thought that it needed dissolving by analysis rather than solving by the production of theories. The Tractatus presents itself as a key for untying a series of knots both profound and highly technical.

3. Ethics and Religion

Wittgenstein had a lifelong interest in religion and claimed to see every problem from a religious point of view, but never committed himself to any formal religion. His various remarks on ethics also suggest a particular point of view, and Wittgenstein often spoke of ethics and religion together. This point of view or attitude can be seen in the four main themes that run through Wittgenstein's writings on ethics and religion: goodness, value or meaning are not to be found in the world; living the right way involves acceptance of or agreement with the world, or life, or God's will, or fate; one who lives this way will see the world as a miracle; there is no answer to the problem of life--the solution is the disappearance of the problem.

Certainly Wittgenstein worried about being morally good or even perfect, and he had great respect for sincere religious conviction, but he also said, in his 1929 lecture on ethics, that "the tendency of all men who ever tried to write or talk Ethics or Religion was to run against the boundaries of language," i.e. to talk or write nonsense. This gives support to the view that Wittgenstein believed in mystical truths that somehow cannot be expressed meaningfully but that are of the utmost importance. It is hard to conceive, though, what these 'truths' might be.

An alternative view is that Wittgenstein believed that there is really nothing to say about ethics. This would explain why he wrote less and less about ethics as his life wore on. His "accept and endure" attitude and belief in going "the bloody hard way" are evident in all his work, especially after the Tractatus. Wittgenstein wants his reader not to think (too much) but to look at the "language games" (any practices that involve language) that give rise to philosophical (personal, existential, spiritual) problems. His approach to such problems is painstaking, thorough, open-eyed and receptive. His ethical attitude is an integral part of his method and shows itself as such.

But there is little to say about such an attitude short of recommending it. In Culture and Value p.29e Wittgenstein writes:

Rules of life are dressed up in pictures. And these pictures can only serve to describe what we are to do, not justify it. Because they could provide a justification only if they held good in other respects as well. I can say: "Thank these bees for their honey as though they were kind people who have prepared it for you"; that is intelligible and describes how I should like you to conduct yourself. But I cannot say: "Thank them because, look, how kind they are!"--since the next moment they may sting you.

In a world of contingency one cannot prove that a particular attitude is the correct one to take. If this suggests relativism, it should be remembered that it too is just one more attitude or point of view, and one without the rich tradition and accumulated wisdom, philosophical reasoning and personal experience of, say, orthodox Christianity or Judaism. Indeed crude relativism, the universal judgement that one cannot make universal judgements, is self- contradictory. Whether Wittgenstein's views suggest a more sophisticated form of relativism is another matter, but the spirit of relativism seems far from Wittgenstein's conservatism and absolute intolerance of his own moral shortcomings. Compare the tolerance that motivates relativism with Wittgenstein's assertion to Russell that he would prefer "by far" an organization dedicated to war and slavery to one dedicated to peace and freedom. (This assertion, however, should not be taken literally: Wittgenstein was no war-monger and even recommended letting oneself be massacred rather than taking part in hand-to-hand combat. It was apparently the complacency, and perhaps the self-righteousness, of Russell's liberal cause that Wittgenstein objected to.)

With regard to religion, Wittgenstein is often considered a kind of Anti-Realist (see below for more on this). He opposed interpretations of religion that emphasize doctrine or philosophical arguments intended to prove God's existence, but was greatly drawn to religious rituals and symbols, and considered becoming a priest. He likened the ritual of religion to a great gesture, as when one kisses a photograph. This is not based on the false belief that the person in the photograph will feel the kiss or return it, nor is it based on any other belief. Neither is the kiss just a substitute for a particular phrase, like "I love you." Like the kiss, religious activity does express an attitude, but it is not just the expression of an attitude in the sense that several other forms of expression might do just as well. There might be no substitute that would do. The same might be said of the whole language-game (or games) of religion, but this is a controversial point. If religious utterances, such as "God exists," are treated as gestures of a certain kind then this seems not to be treating them as literal statements. Many religious believers, including Wittgensteinian ones, would object strongly to this. There is room, though, for a good deal of sophisticated disagreement about what it means to take a statement literally. For instance, Charles Taylor's view, roughly, is that the real is whatever will not go away. If we cannot reduce talk about God to anything else, or replace it, or prove it false, then perhaps God is as real as anything else.

4. Conception of Philosophy

Wittgenstein's view of what philosophy is, or should be, changed little over his life. In the Tractatus he says at 4.111 that "philosophy is not one of the natural sciences," and at 4.112 "Philosophy aims at the logical clarification of thoughts." Philosophy is not descriptive but elucidatory. Its aim is to clear up muddle and confusion. It follows that philosophers should not concern themselves so much with what is actual, keeping up with the latest popularizations of science, say, which Wittgenstein despised. The philosopher's proper concern is with what is possible, or rather with what is conceivable. This depends on our concepts and the ways they fit together as seen in language. What is conceivable and what is not, what makes sense and what does not, depends on the rules of language, of grammar.

In Philosophical Investigations Sect. 90 Wittgenstein says:

Our investigation is a grammatical one. Such an investigation sheds light on our problem by clearing misunderstandings away. Misunderstandings concerning the use of words, caused, among other things, by certain analogies between the forms of expression in different regions of language.

The similarities between the sentences "I'll keep it in mind" and "I'll keep it in this box," for instance, (along with many others) can lead one to think of the mind as a thing something like a box with contents of its own. The nature of this box and its mental contents can then seem very mysterious. Wittgenstein suggests that one way, at least, to deal with such mysteries is to recall the different things one says about minds, memories, thoughts and so on, in a variety of contexts.

What one says, or what people in general say, can change. Ways of life and uses of language change, so meanings change, but not utterly and instantaneously. Things shift and evolve, but rarely if ever so drastically that we lose all grip on meaning. So there is no timeless essence of at least some and perhaps all concepts, but we still understand one another well enough most of the time.

When nonsense is spoken or written, or when something just seems fishy, we can sniff it out. The road out of confusion can be a long and difficult one, hence the need for constant attention to detail and particular examples rather than generalizations, which tend to be vague and therefore potentially misleading. The slower the route, the surer the safety at the end of it. That is why Wittgenstein said that in philosophy the winner is the one who finishes last. But we cannot escape language or the confusions to which it gives rise, except by dying. In the meantime, Wittgenstein offers four main methods to avoid philosophical confusion, as described by Norman Malcolm: describing circumstances in which a seemingly problematic expression might actually be used in everyday life, comparing our use of words with imaginary language games, imagining fictitious natural history, and explaining psychologically the temptation to use a certain expression inappropriately.

The complex, intertwined relationship between a language and the form of life that goes with it means that problems arising from language cannot just be set aside--they infect our lives, making us live in confusion. We might find our way back to the right path, but there is no guarantee that we will never again stray. In this sense there can be no progress in philosophy.

In 1931 Wittgenstein described his task thus:

Language sets everyone the same traps; it is an immense network of easily accessible wrong turnings. And so we watch one man after another walking down the same paths and we know in advance where he will branch off, where walk straight on without noticing the side turning, etc. etc. What I have to do then is erect signposts at all the junctions where there are wrong turnings so as to help people past the danger points.

But such signposts are all that philosophy can offer and there is no certainty that they will be noticed or followed correctly. And we should remember that a signpost belongs in the context of a particular problem area. It might be no help at all elsewhere, and should not be treated as dogma. So philosophy offers no truths, no theories, nothing exciting, but mainly reminders of what we all know. This is not a glamorous role, but it is difficult and important. It requires an almost infinite capacity for taking pains (which is one definition of genius) and could have enormous implications for anyone who is drawn to philosophical contemplation or who is misled by bad philosophical theories. This applies not only to professional philosophers but to any people who stray into philosophical confusion, perhaps not even realizing that their problems are philosophical and not, say, scientific.

5. Meaning

Sect. 43 of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations says that: "For a large class of cases--though not for all--in which we employ the word "meaning" it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language."

It is quite clear that here Wittgenstein is not offering the general theory that "meaning is use," as he is sometimes interpreted as doing. The main rival views that Wittgenstein warns against are that the meaning of a word is some object that it names--in which case the meaning of a word could be destroyed, stolen or locked away, which is nonsense--and that the meaning of a word is some psychological feeling--in which case each user of a word could mean something different by it, having a different feeling, and communication would be difficult if not impossible.

Knowing the meaning of a word can involve knowing many things: to what objects the word refers (if any), whether it is slang or not, what part of speech it is, whether it carries overtones, and if so what kind they are, and so on. To know all this, or to know enough to get by, is to know the use. And generally knowing the use means knowing the meaning. Philosophical questions about consciousness, for example, then, should be responded to by looking at the various uses we make of the word "consciousness." Scientific investigations into the brain are not directly relevant to this inquiry (although they might be indirectly relevant if scientific discoveries led us to change our use of such words). The meaning of any word is a matter of what we do with our language, not something hidden inside anyone's mind or brain. This is not an attack on neuroscience. It is merely distinguishing philosophy (which is properly concerned with linguistic or conceptual analysis) from science (which is concerned with discovering facts).

One exception to the meaning-is-use rule of thumb is given in Philosophical Investigations Sect.561, where Wittgenstein says that "the word "is" is used with two different meanings (as the copula and as the sign of equality)" but that its meaning is not its use. That is to say, "is" has not one complex use (including both "Water is clear" and "Water is H2O") and therefore one complex meaning, but two quite distinct uses and meanings. It is an accident that the same word has these two uses. It is not an accident that we use the word "car" to refer to both Fords and Hondas. But what is accidental and what is essential to a concept depends on us, on how we use it.

This is not completely arbitrary, however. Depending on one's environment, one's physical needs and desires, one's emotions, one's sensory capacities, and so on, different concepts will be more natural or useful to one. This is why "forms of life" are so important to Wittgenstein. What matters to you depends on how you live (and vice versa), and this shapes your experience. So if a lion could speak, Wittgenstein says, we would not be able to understand it. We might realize that "roar" meant zebra, or that "roar, roar" meant lame zebra, but we would not understand lion ethics, politics, aesthetic taste, religion, humor and such like, if lions have these things. We could not honestly say "I know what you mean" to a lion. Understanding another involves empathy, which requires the kind of similarity that we just do not have with lions, and that many people do not have with other human beings.

When a person says something what he or she means depends not only on what is said but also on the context in which it is said. Importance, point, meaning are given by the surroundings. Words, gestures, expressions come alive, as it were, only within a language game, a culture, a form of life. If a picture, say, means something then it means so to somebody. Its meaning is not an objective property of the picture in the way that its size and shape are. The same goes of any mental picture. Hence Wittgenstein's remark that "If God had looked into our minds he would not have been able to see there whom we were speaking of." Any internal image would need interpretation. If I interpret my thought as one of Hitler and God sees it as Charlie Chaplin, who is right? Which of the two famous contemporaries of Wittgenstein's I mean shows itself in the way I behave, the things I do and say. It is in this that the use, the meaning, of my thought or mental picture lies. "The arrow points only in the application that a living being makes of it."

6. Rules and Private Language

Without sharing certain attitudes towards the things around us, without sharing a sense of relevance and responding in similar ways, communication would be impossible. It is important, for instance, that nearly all of us agree nearly all the time on what colors things are. Such agreement is part of our concept of color, Wittgenstein suggests. Regularity of the use of such concepts and agreement in their application is part of language, not a logically necessary precondition of it. We cannot separate the life in which there is such agreement from our concept of color. Imagine a different form or way of life and you imagine a different language with different concepts, different rules and a different logic.

This raises the question of the relation between language and forms or ways of life. For instance, could just one person have a language of his or her own? To imagine an individual solitary from birth is scarcely to imagine a form of life at all, but more like just imagining a life- form. Moreover, language involves rules establishing certain linguistic practices. Rules of grammar express the fact that it is our practice to say this (e.g. "half past twelve") and not that (e.g. "half to one"). Agreement is essential to such practices. Could a solitary individual, then, engage in any practice, including linguistic ones? With whom could he or she agree? This is a controversial issue in the interpretation of Wittgenstein. Gordon Baker and P.M.S. Hacker hold that such a solitary man could speak his own language, follow his own rules, and so on, agreeing, over time, with himself in his judgements and behavior. Orthodoxy is against this interpretation, however.

Norman Malcolm has written that "If you conceive of an individual who has been in solitude his whole life long, then you have cut away the background of instruction, correction, acceptance--in short, the circumstances in which a rule is given, enforced, and followed." Mere regularity of behavior does not constitute following rules, whether they be rules of grammar or any other kind. A car that never starts in cold weather does not follow the rule "Don't start when it's cold," nor does a songbird follow a rule in singing the same song every day. Whether a solitary-from-birth individual would ever do anything that we would properly call following a rule is at least highly doubtful. How could he or she give himself or herself a rule to follow without language? And how could he or she get a language? Inventing one would involve inventing meaning, as Rush Rhees has argued, and this sounds incoherent. (The most famous debate about this was between Rhees and A.J. Ayer. Unfortunately for Wittgenstein, Ayer is generally considered to have won.) Alternatively, perhaps the Crusoe-like figure just does behave, sound, etc. just like a native speaker of, say, English. But this is to imagine either a freakish automaton, not a human being, or else a miracle. In the case of a miracle, Wittgenstein says, it is significant that we imagine not just the pseudo- Crusoe but also God. In the case of the automatic speaker, we might adopt what Daniel Dennett calls an "intentional stance" towards him, calling what he does "speaking English," but he is obviously not doing what the rest of us English-speakers--who learned the language, rather than being born speaking it, and who influence and are influenced by others in our use of the language--do.

The debate about solitary individuals is sometimes referred to as the debate about "private language." Wittgenstein uses this expression in another context, however, to name a language that refers to private sensations. Such a private language by definition cannot be understood by anyone other than its user (who alone knows the sensations to which it refers). Wittgenstein invites us to imagine a man who decides to write 'S' in his diary whenever he has a certain sensation. This sensation has no natural expression, and 'S' cannot be defined in words. The only judge of whether 'S' is used correctly is the inventor of 'S'. The only criterion of correctness is whether a sensation feels the same to him or her. There are no criteria for its being the same other than its seeming the same. So he writes 'S' when he feels like it. He might as well be doodling. The so-called 'private language' is no language at all. The point of this is not to show that a private language is impossible but to show that certain things one might want to say about language are ultimately incoherent. If we really try to picture a world of private objects (sensations) and inner acts of meaning and so on, we see that what we picture is either regular public language or incomprehensible behavior (the man might as well quack as say or write 'S').

This does not, as has been alleged, make Wittgenstein a behaviorist. He does not deny the existence of sensations or experiences. Pains, tickles, itches, etc. are all part of human life, of course. At Philosophical Investigations Sect. 293 Wittgenstein says that "if we construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of 'object and designation' the object drops out of consideration as irrelevant." This suggests not that pains and so on are irrelevant but that we should not construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of 'object and designation'. If we want to understand a concept like pain we should not think of a pain as a private object referred to somehow by the public word "pain." A pain is not "a something," just as love, democracy and strength are not things, but it is no more "a nothing" than they are either (see Philosophical Investigations Sect. 304). Saying this is hardly satisfactory, but there is no simple answer to the question "What is pain?" Wittgenstein offers not an answer but a kind of philosophical 'therapy' intended to clear away what can seem so obscure. To judge the value of this therapy, the reader will just have to read Wittgenstein's work for herself.

The best known work on Wittgenstein's writings on this whole topic is Saul A. Kripke's Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Kripke is struck by the idea that anything might count as continuing a series or following a rule in the same way. It all depends on how the rule or series is interpreted. And any rule for interpretation will itself be subject to a variety of interpretations, and so on. What counts as following a rule correctly, then, is not determined somehow by the rule itself but by what the relevant linguistic community accepts as following the rule. So whether two plus two equals four depends not on some abstract, extra-human rule of addition, but on what we, and especially the people we appoint as experts, accept. Truth conditions are replaced by assertability conditions. To put it crudely, what counts is not what is true or right (in some sense independent of the community of language users), but what you can get away with or get others to accept.

Kripke's theory is clear and ingenious, and owes a lot to Wittgenstein, but is doubtful as an interpretation of Wittgenstein. Kripke himself presents the argument not as Wittgenstein's, nor as his own, but as "Wittgenstein's argument as it struck Kripke" (Kripke p.5). That the argument is not Wittgenstein's is suggested by the fact that it is a theory, and Wittgenstein rejected philosophical theories, and by the fact that the argument relies heavily on the first sentence of Philosophical Investigations Sect. 201: "This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule." For Kripke's theory as a reading of Wittgenstein, it is not good that the very next paragraph begins, "It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here..." Still, it is no easy matter to see just where Wittgenstein does diverge from the hybrid person often referred to as 'Kripkenstein'. The key perhaps lies later in the same paragraph, where Wittgenstein writes that "there is a way of grasping a rule which is not an interpretation". Many scholars, notably Baker and Hacker, have gone to great lengths to explain why Kripke is mistaken. Since Kripke is so much easier to understand, one of the best ways into Wittgenstein's philosophy is to study Kripke and his Wittgensteinian critics. At the very least, Kripke introduces his readers well to issues that were of great concern to Wittgenstein and shows their importance.

7. Realism and Anti-Realism

Wittgenstein's place in the debate about philosophical Realism and Anti-Realism is an interesting one. His emphasis on language and human behavior, practices, etc. makes him a prime candidate for Anti-Realism in many people's eyes. He has even been accused of linguistic idealism, the idea that language is the ultimate reality. The laws of physics, say, would by this theory just be laws of language, the rules of the language game of physics. Anti-Realist scepticism of this kind has proved quite popular in the philosophy of science and in theology, as well as more generally in metaphysics and ethics.

On the other hand, there is a school of Wittgensteinian Realism, which is less well known. Wittgenstein's views on religion, for instance, are often compared with those of Simone Weil, who was a Platonist of sorts. Sabina Lovibond argues for a kind of Wittgensteinian Realism in ethics in her Realism and Imagination in Ethics and the influence of Wittgenstein is clear in Raimond Gaita's Good and Evil: An Absolute Conception. However, one should not go too far with the idea of Wittgensteinian Realism. Lovibond, for instance, equates objectivity with intersubjectivity (universal agreement), so her Realism is of a controversial kind.

Both Realism and Anti-Realism, though, are theories, or schools of theories, and Wittgenstein explicitly rejects the advocacy of theories in philosophy. This does not prove that he practiced what he preached, but it should give us pause. It is also worth noting that supporters of Wittgenstein often claim that he was neither a Realist nor an Anti-Realist, at least with regard to metaphysics. There is something straightforwardly unWittgensteinian about the Realist's belief that language/thought can be compared with reality and found to 'agree' with it. The Anti-Realist says that we could not get outside our thought or language (or form of life or language games) to compare the two. But Wittgenstein was concerned not with what we can or cannot do, but with what makes sense. If metaphysical Realism is incoherent then so is its opposite. The nonsensical utterance "laubgefraub" is not to be contradicted by saying, "No, it is not the case that laubgefraub," or "Laubgefraub is a logical impossibility." If Realism is truly incoherent, as Wittgenstein would say, then so is Anti-Realism.

8. Certainty

Wittgenstein's last writings were on the subject of certainty. He wrote in response to G.E. Moore's attack on scepticism about the external world. Moore had held up one hand, said "Here is one hand," then held up his other hand and said "and here is another." His point was that things outside the mind really do exist, we know they do, and that no grounds for scepticism could be strong enough to undermine this commonsense knowledge.

Wittgenstein did not defend scepticism, but questioned Moore's claim to know that he had two hands. Such 'knowledge' is not something that one is ever taught, or finds out, or proves. It is more like a background against which we come to know other things. Wittgenstein compares this background to the bed of a river. This river bed provides the support, the context, in which claims to know various things have meaning. The bed itself is not something we can know or doubt. In normal circumstances no sane person doubts how many hands he or she has. But unusual circumstances can occur and what was part of the river bed can shift and become part of the river. I might, for instance, wake up dazed after a terrible accident and wonder whether my hands, which I cannot feel, are still there or not. This is quite different, though, from Descartes's pretended doubt as to whether he has a body at all. Such radical doubt is really not doubt at all, from Wittgenstein's point of view. And so it cannot be dispelled by a proof that the body exists, as Moore tried to do.

9. Continuity

Wittgenstein is generally considered to have changed his thinking considerably over his philosophical career. His early work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus with its picture theory of language and mysticism, according to this view. Then there came a transitional middle period when he first returned to philosophical work after realizing that he had not solved all the problems of philosophy. This period led to his mature, later period which gave us the Philosophical Investigations and On Certainty.

There certainly are marked changes in Wittgenstein's work, but the differences between his early and late work can be exaggerated. Two central discontinuities in his work are these: whereas the Tractatus is concerned with the general form of the proposition, the general nature of metaphysics, and so on, in his later work Wittgenstein is very critical of "the craving for generality"; and, in the Tractatus Wittgenstein speaks of the central problems of philosophy, whereas the later work treats no problems as central. Another obvious difference is in Wittgenstein's style. The Tractatus is a carefully constructed set of short propositions. The Investigations, though also consisting of numbered sections, is longer, less clearly organized and more rambling, at least in appearance. This reflects Wittgenstein's rejection of the idea that there are just a few central problems in philosophy, and his insistence on paying attention to particular cases, going over the rough ground.

On the other hand, the Tractatus itself says that its propositions are nonsense and thus, in a sense (not easy to understand), rejects itself. The fact that the later work also criticizes the Tractatus is not, therefore, proof of discontinuity in Wittgenstein's work. The main change may have been one of method and style. Problems are investigated one at a time, although many overlap. There is not a full-frontal assault on the problem or problems of philosophy. Otherwise, the Tractatus and the Philosophical Investigations attack much the same problems; they just do so in different ways.

10. Wittgenstein in History

Wittgenstein's place in the history of philosophy is a peculiar one. His philosophical education was unconventional (going from engineering to working first-hand with one of the greatest philosophers of his day in Bertrand Russell) and he seems never to have felt the need to go back and make a thorough study of the history of philosophy. He was interested in Plato, admired Leibniz, but was most influenced by the work of Schopenhauer, Russell and Frege.

From Schopenhauer (perhaps) Wittgenstein got his interest in solipsism and in the ethical nature of the relation between the will and the world. Schopenhauer's saying that "The world is my idea," (from The World as Will and Idea) is echoed in such remarks as "The world is my world" (from Tractatus 5.62). What Wittgenstein means here, where he also says that what the solipsist means is quite correct, but that it cannot be said, is obscure and controversial. Some have taken him to mean that solipsism is true but for some reason cannot be expressed. H.O. Mounce, in his valuable Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction, says that this interpretation is surely wrong. Mounce's view is that Wittgenstein holds solipsism itself to be a confusion, but one that sometimes arises when one tries to express the fact that "I have a point of view on the world which is without neighbours." (Mounce p.91) Wittgenstein was not a solipsist but he remained interested in solipsism and related problems of scepticism throughout his life.

Frege was a mathematician as well as a logician. He was interested in questions of truth and falsehood, sense and reference (a distinction he made famous) and in the relation between objects and concepts, propositions and thoughts. But his interest was in logic and mathematics exclusively, not in psychology or ethics. His great contribution to logic was to introduce various mathematical elements into formal logic, including quantification, functions, arguments (in the mathematical sense of something substituted for a variable in a function) and the value of a function. In logic this value, according to Frege, is always either the True or the False, hence the notion of truth-value. Both Frege and Russell wanted to show that mathematics is an extension of logic. Undoubtedly both men influenced Wittgenstein enormously, especially since he worked first-hand with Russell. Some measure of their importance to him can be seen in the preface to the Tractatus, where Wittgenstein says that he is "indebted to Frege's great works and to the writings of my friend Mr Bertrand Russell for much of the stimulation of my thoughts." For some insight into whether Frege or Russell had the greater influence one can consider whether one would rather be recognized for his or her great works or for simply being a friend.

In turn Wittgenstein influenced twentieth century philosophy enormously. The Vienna Circle logical positivists were greatly impressed by what they found in the Tractatus, especially the idea that logic and mathematics are analytic, the verifiability principle and the idea that philosophy is an activity aimed at clarification, not the discovery of facts. Wittgenstein, though, said that it was what is not in the Tractatus that matters most.

The other group of philosophers most obviously indebted to Wittgenstein is the ordinary language or Oxford school of thought. These thinkers were more interested in Wittgenstein's later work and its attention to grammar.

Wittgenstein is thus a doubly key figure in the development and history of analytic philosophy, but he has become rather unfashionable because of his anti-theoretical, anti-scientism stance, because of the difficulty of his work, and perhaps also because he has been little understood. Similarities between Wittgenstein's work and that of Derrida are now generating interest among continental philosophers, and Wittgenstein may yet prove to be a driving force behind the emerging post-analytic school of philosophy.

11. References and Further Reading

A full bibliographical guide to works by and on Wittgenstein would fill a whole book, namely Wittgenstein: A Bibliographical Guide by Guido Frongia and Brian McGuinness (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1990). Obviously this is already out of date. Instead of a complete guide, therefore, what follows is a list of some of Wittgenstein's main works, some of the best secondary material on his work, and a few other works chosen for their accessibility and entertainment value, for want of a better expression.

a. Wittgenstein's Main Works

  • Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, translated by D.F. Pears and B.F. McGuinness (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1961).
    • His early classic.
  • The Blue and Brown Books, (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1969).
    • From his middle period, these are preliminary studies for his later work.
  • Philosophical Investigations, translated by G.E.M. Anscombe (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1963).
    • His late classic.
  • On Certainty, edited by G.E.M. Anscombe and G.H. von Wright, translated by Denis Paul and G.E.M. Anscombe (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1979).
    • Like many of Wittgenstein's works, this was compiled after his death from notes he had made. In this case the notes come from the last year and a half of his life.Works of more general interest by Wittgenstein include these:
  • Culture and Value, translated by Peter Winch (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1980).
    • These are notes from throughout Wittgenstein's life dealing with all kinds of topics hinted at by its title, including music, literature, philosophy, religion and the value of silliness.
  • Lectures and Conversations on Aesthetics, Psychology and Religious Belief, edited by Cyril Barrett (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1966).
    • For 'psychology' read 'Freud', otherwise the title is explanation enough. Hilary Putnam has recommended the section on religion as a valuable introduction to Wittgenstein's philosophy as a whole.

b. Some Biographies of Wittgenstein

  • Ray Monk Ludwig Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius (Jonathan Cape, London 1990).
    • Full of enlightening detail.
  • Norman Malcolm Ludwig Wittgenstein: A Memoir (Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York 1984).
    • Shorter and includes material from G.H. von Wright as well. Two of the best books on the Tractatus are:
  • G.E.M. Anscombe An Introduction to Wittgenstein's Tractatus (University of Pennsylvania Press, Philadelphia 1971).
    • Emphasizes the importance of Frege and is notoriously difficult
  • H.O. Mounce Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1981).
    • Lighter but more reader-friendly.

c. Secondary Works

A good rule of thumb for picking secondary material on Wittgenstein is to trust Wittgenstein's own judgement. He chose G.E.M. Anscombe, Rush Rhees and G.H. von Wright to understand and deal with his unpublished writings after his death. Anything by one of these people should be fairly reliable. More contentiously, I would say that the best people writing on Wittgenstein today are James Conant and Cora Diamond. Other books referred to in the text above or of special note are these:

  • O.K. Bouwsma Wittgenstein: Conversations 1949-1951, edited by J.L. Craft and Ronald E. Hustwit (Hackett, Indianapolis 1986).
    • A seemingly little read slim volume that includes records of Wittgenstein's comments on such diverse and interesting topics as Descartes, utilitarianism and the word 'cheeseburger'.
  • Stanley Cavell The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy (Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York 1979).
    • A long, rich, challenging classic.
  • Cora Diamond The Realistic Spirit: Wittgenstein, Philosophy, and the Mind (MIT, Cambridge, Massachusetts 1991).
    • A collection of essays of varying degrees of accessibility on Frege, Wittgenstein and ethics, united by their Wittgensteinian spirit.
  • M.O'C. Drury The Danger of Words (Thoemmes Press, Bristol, U.K. and Washington, D.C. 1996).
    • A classic, including discussions of issues in psychiatry and religion by a friend of Wittgenstein's.
  • Paul Engelmann Letters from Wittgenstein with a memoir (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1967).
    • Includes discussions by Wittgenstein and his friend Engelmann on the Tractatus, religion, literature and culture.
  • Saul A. Kripke Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language (Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts 1982).
    • See the section on rules and private language above.
  • Norman Malcolm Wittgenstein: Nothing is Hidden (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1986).
    • One of the best accounts of Wittgenstein's philosophy from the disreputable point of view that the Tractatus advanced theses which are then attacked in the later work.
  • Norman Malcolm Wittgenstein: A Religious Point of View?, edited with a response by Peter Winch (Cornell University Press, Ithaca, New York 1994).
    • Malcolm basically summarizes Wittgenstein's philosophy, as he understands it, with a special emphasis on religion. Winch then responds, correcting Malcolm's account where necessary. The result is a highly accessible composite overview of Wittgenstein's work from the religious point of view, which is how Wittgenstein himself said that he saw every problem.

Author Information

Duncan J. Richter
Virginia Military Institute
U. S. A.

Vasubandhu (fl. 4th or 5th cn. C.E.)

VasubandhuVasubandhu was a prominent Buddhist teacher and one of the most important figures in the development of Mahyna Buddhism in India. Though he is particularly admired by later Buddhists as co-founder of the Yogcra school along with his half brother Asanga, his pre-Yogcra works, such as the Abhidharmakosha and his auto-commentary (Abhidharmakoshabhshya) on it, are considered masterpieces. He wrote commentaries on many stras, works on logic, devotional poetry, works on Abhidharma classifications, as well as original and innovative philosophical treatises. Some of his writings have survived in their original Sanskrit form, but many others, particularly his commentaries, are extant only in their Chinese or Tibetan translations. Vasubandhu was a many-sided thinker, and his personality as it emerges from his works and his biographies shows him as a man who was not only a great genius and a philosopher, but also a human being who was filled with great compassion.

Table of Contents

  1. Sources on the Biography of Vasubandhu
  2. Early Life of Vasubandhu
  3. Conversion to Mahayana
  4. Intellectual Debates
  5. Date of Vasubandhu
  6. Writings of Vasubandhu
  7. References and Further Readings

1. Sources on the Biography of Vasubandhu

The most important and the only complete account of the life of Vasubandhu entitled Posou pandoufa shijuan (Biography of Master Vasubandhu) was compiled into Chinese by Paramartha (499-569 C.E.), one of the chief exponents of Yogacara doctrine in China. It is preserved in the Chinese Tripitaka and its English translation was published by J. Takakusu in T'oung Pao (1904: 269-296). Apart from this account, the Xiyuji of Xuanzang (600-664 C.E.) also provides important information about the life of Vasubandhu. Though Paramartha and Xuanzang are the two most credible authorities for Vasubandhu's life, yet serious discrepancies exist between their accounts. Paramartha's account not only contains legendary or even mythical elements, but the time sequence of events is also ambiguous and differs greatly in places from the account of Xuanzang's the Xiyuji. The Tibetan historians, Taranatha and Bu-ston, also give some important information on Vasubandhu's life, but their account further disagrees with Paramartha and Xuanzang in terms of certain names and events associated with the life of Vasubandhu. Scholars once suspected that more than one person bore the name Vasubandhu in the history of Indian Buddhism, although recent studies have eliminated this hypothesis.

2. Early Life of Vasubandhu

He was born at Purusapura (identified with modern Peshawar, capital of North-West Frontier Province of Pakistan) in the state of Gandhara. Gandhara is best known today as one of the earliest regions to develop a distinctive form of Buddhist art noted for its Hellenistic influence. According to Taranatha, Vasubandhu was born one year after his older brother Asanga became a Buddhist monk. His father was a brahmanaof the Kaushika gotra. According to Posou pandou fashi zhuan his mother's name was Virinci. But Bu-ston and Taranatha mention the name of the mother of Asanga and Vasubandhu as Prasannashila. According to these two Tibetan historians, Asanga and Vasubandhu were half-brothers; Asanga's father being a kshatriya, and Vasubandhu's a brahmana. Vasubandhu also had a younger brother called Virincivatsa. Vasubandhu's father was a court priest, and according to Taranatha was an authority on the Vedas. In all probability, he officiated at the court of the Shaka princes of the Shilada clan, who at that time ruled from Purusapura. During the formative years of his life, Vasubandhu may have been introduced by his father not only to the Brahmanical tradition but also to the postulates of classical Nyaya and Vaisheshika, both of which had influence on his logical thought.

As a young student, he amazed his teachers with his brilliance and ready wit. According to Paramartha, Vasubandhu's teacher was called Buddhamitra. The Xiyuji, however, never mentions Buddhamitra and names Manoratha as the teacher of Vasubandhu. At Vasubandhu's time the dominant Buddhist school in Gandhara was the Vaibhashika (also called Sarvastivada). Vasubandhu entered the Sarvastivada order, and studied primarily the scholastic system of the Vaibhashikas. Initially, he was quite impressed with the Mahavibhasha. In time, however, Vasubandhu began to have grave doubts about the validity and relevance of Vaibhashika metaphysics. At this time, perhaps through the brilliant teacher Manoratha, he came into contact with the theories of the Sautrantikas, the group of Buddhists who wished to reject everything that was not the express word of the Buddha, and who held the elaborate constructions of the Vibhasha up to ridicule. That there was a strong Sautrantika tradition in Purusapura is likely in view of the fact that it was the birthplace of that maverick philosopher of the second century, Dharmatrata. In fact, the most orthodox Vaibhashika seat of learning was not in Gandhara, but in Kashmir, whose masters looked down upon the Gandharans as quasi-heretics. Therefore, according to Xuanzang's pupil Pu Kuang, Vasubandhu decided to go to Kashmir disguised as a lunatic to investigate the Vaibhashika teachings more deeply. Vasubandhu studied in Kashmir with different teachers for four years and then came back to Purusapura.

After having returned to his native place, Vasubandhu began to prepare for an enormous project that had been in his mind for some time. At this time he was unattached to any particular order, and lived in a small private house in the center of Purusapura. Vasubandhu supported himself by lecturing on Buddhism before the general public, which presumably remunerated him with gifts. According to tradition, during the day he would lecture on Vaibhashika doctrine and in the evening distill the day's lectures into a verse. When collected together the six hundred plus verses (karikas) gave a thorough summary of the entire system. He entitled this work the Abhidharmakosha (Treasury of Abhidharma). According to Paramartha, Vasubandhu composed the Abhidharmakosha at Ayodhya, but according to Xuanzang, it was composed in the suburbs of Purusapura. In the Abhidharmakosha Vasubandhu analyzed and catalogued seventy-five dharmas, the basic factors of experience, for the purposes of attaining Bodhi. He divided them into various categories consisting of eleven types of rupani i.e., ‘material forms' (the five sense organs, their corresponding objects, and avijnapti-rupa i.e., ‘gesture unrevealing of intent'); citta (mind); ten types of mahaabhumika i.e., ‘major groundings' (volition, desire, mindfulness, attention, and so forth); ten types of kushala-mahabhumika i.e., ‘advantageous major groundings' (faith, vigor, equanimity, ahimsa, serenity, and so forth); six types of klesha-mahabhumika i.e., ‘mental disturbance major groundings' (confusion, carelessness, restlessness, and so forth); two types of akushala mahabhumika i.e., ‘nonadvantageous major groundings (shamelessness and non-embarrassment); ten types of paritta-klesha-mahabhumika i.e., ‘secondary mental disturbance major groundings' (anger, enmity, envy, conceit, and so forth); eight types of aniyata-mahabhumika i.e., ‘indeterminate major groundings' (remorse, arrigance, aversion, doubt, torpor, and so forth); fourteen types of citta-viprayukta-samskara-dharmah i.e. ‘embodied-conditioning disassociated from mind' (life-force, birth, decay, impermanence, and so forth); and three types of asamskrita-dharmah i.e., ‘unconditioned dharmas (spatiality, cessation through understanding, and cessation without understanding). Not only were the definitions and interrelations of these seventy-five dharmas analyzed in the Abhidharmakosha, but their karmic qualities also examined. Besides, Vasubandhu also elaborated upon causal theories, cosmology, practices of meditation, theories of perception, karma, rebirth, and the characteristics of an Enlightened Being in this text.

As the Abhidharmakosha was an eloquent summary of the purport of the Mahavibhasha, the Kashmiri Sarvastivadins are reported to have rejoiced to see in it all their doctrines so well propounded. Accordingly, they requested Vasubandhu to write a prose commentary (bhashya) on it. However, it seems that after having written the Abhidharmakosha, Vasubandhu began to have second thoughts about the Vaibhashika teachings. As a consequence, it is said, Vasubandhu prepared the Abhidharmakoshabhashya. But as it contained a thoroughgoing critique of Vaibhashika dogmatics from a Sautrantika viewpoint, the Kashmiri Sarvastivadins soon realized, to their great disappointment, that the Abhidharmakoshabhashya in fact refuted many Sarvastivada theories and upheld the doctrines of the Sautrantika school. One major point that created bad blood between the Vaibhashikas and the Sautrantikas was concerning the status and nature of the dharmas. The Vaibhashikas held that the dharmas exist in the past and future as well as the present. On the other hand, the Sautrantikas held the view that they are discrete, particular moments only existing at the present moment in which they discharge causal efficacy. The Vaibhashikas wrote several treatises attempting to refute Vasubandhu's critiques.

3. Conversion to Mahayana

In the years directly following the composition of the Abhidharmakoshabhashya, Vasubandhu seems to have spent much time in travelling from place to place. Finally, after having spent some time at Shakala/ Shagala (modern Sialkot in Pakistan), he shifted along with his teachers Buddhamitra and Manoratha to Ayodhya (now located in Uttar Pradesh, northern India), a city far removed from Kashmir. According to Posou pandou fashi zhuan, Vasubandhu, now proud of the fame he had acquired, clung faithfully to the Hinayana doctrine in which he was well-versed and, having no faith in the Mahayana, denied that it was the teaching of the Buddha. Vasubandhu had up to this time but little regard for the Yogacara treatises of his elder brother. He had perhaps seen the voluminous Yogacarabhumi compiled by Asanga, which may have simply repelled him by its bulk. According to Bu-ston, he is reported to have said, "Alas, Asanga, residing in the forest, has practised meditation for twelve years. Without having attained anything by this meditation, he has founded a system, so difficult and burdensome, that it can be carried only by an elephant." Asanga heard about this attitude of his brother and feared that Vasubandhu would use his great intellectual gifts to undermine the Mahayana. By feigning illness he was able to summon his younger brother to Purusapura, where he lived. However, Xuanzang differs with some of these details and the place provided by Paramartha regarding Vasubandhu's conversion. According to the Xiyuji the conversion of Vasubandhu took place at Ayodhya. At the rendezvous, Vasubandhu asked Asanga to explain the Mahayana teaching to him, whereupon he immediately realized the supremacy of Mahayana thought. After further study, we are told, the depth of his realization came to equal that of his brother. Deeply ashamed of his former abuse of the Mahayana, Vasubandhu wanted to cut out his tongue, but refrained from doing so when Asanga told him to use it for the cause of Mahayana. Vasubandhu regarded the study of the enormous Shatasahasrikaprajna-paramita-sutra as of utmost importance. In view of the fact that they were the texts that converted him to Mahayana, Vasubandhu's commentaries on the Akshayamatinirdesha-sutra and the Dasha-bhumika may have been his earliest Mahayana works. These were followed by a series of commentaries on other Mahayana sutras and treatises, including the Avatamsakasutra, Nirvanasutra, Vimalakirtinirdeshasutra, and Shrimaladevisutra. He himself composed a treatise on vijnaptimatra (cognition only) theory and commented on the Mahayanasamgraha, Triratna-gotra, Amrita-mukha, and other Mahayana treatises. According to the Tibetan biographers, his favorite sutra was either the Shatasahasrikaprajna-paramita-sutra or the Ashtasahasrika. Considering that these texts reveal the most profound insights into Mahayana thinking, it is not surprising that Vasubandhu liked them. Since the output of Vasubandhu's Mahayana works is huge, he was in all probability writing new treatises every year. According to Posou pandou fashi zhuan Vasubandhu engaged in his literary activity on behalf of the Mahayana after Asanga's death. Xuanzang, however, tells a strange story that suggests that Vasubandhu died before Asanga.

4. Intellectual Debates

With the composition of the Abhidharmakosha, Vasubandhu came to enjoy the patronage and favor of two Gupta rulers, Vikramaditya and his heir Baladitya, who can be identified respectively, as Skandagupta (ruled circa 455-467 C.E.) and Narasimhagupta (ruled circa 467-473 C.E.). The first important intellectual debate which Vasubandhu had was with Vasurata. Vasurata was a grammarian and the husband of the younger sister of Baladitya. It was Baladitya who had challenged Vasubandhu to a debate. Vasubandhu was able to defeat him successfully. Another well-known intellectual encounter which Vasubandhu had was with Samkhyas. While Vasubandhu was away, his old master Buddhamitra was defeated in a debate at Ayodhya by Vindhyavasin. When Vasubandhu came to know of it, he was enraged and subsequently trounced the Samkhyas both in debate and in a treatise the Paramarthasaptatika. Candragupta II rewarded him with 300,000 gold coins for his victory over the Samkhyas. Vasubandhu made use of this money to build three monasteries, one for the Mahayanists, another one for his old colleagues the Sarvastivadins, and a third for nuns. Refutation of Vaisheshika and Samkhya theories had been presented by Vasubandhu already in the Abhidharmakosha, but it was perhaps from this point onward that Vasubandhu was regarded as a philosopher whose views could not be lightly challenged. Samghabhadra, a Sarvastivada scholar from Kashmir, also once challenged Vasubandhu regarding the Abhidharmakosha. He composed two treatises, one consisting of 10,000 verses and another of 120,000 verses. According to Xuanzang, it took twelve years for Samghabhadra to finish the two works. He challenged Vasubandhu to a debate, but Vasubandhu refused, saying, "I am already old, so I will let you say what you wish. Long ago, this work of mine destroyed the Vaibhashika (that is, the Sarvastivada) doctrines. There is no need now of confronting you... Wise men will know which of us is right and which one is wrong."

5. Date of Vasubandhu

The date of Vasubandhu has posed a problem for historians. According to Paramartha, Vasubandhu lived 900 years after the Mahaparinirvana of the Buddha. At another place, Paramartha also mentions the figure of 1100. Xuanzang and his disciples respectively mention that Vasubandhu lived 1000 and 900 years after the Mahaparinirvana of the Buddha. Now though it is generally believed that the Mahaparinirvana of the Buddha took place within few years of 400 B.C.E., some scholars are still hesitant to accept this date. This has led to different scholars proposing different dates for Vasubandhu. Noul Pari and Shio Benkyoo give as Vasubandhu's dates the years 270 to 350 C.E.. Steven Anacker proposes his date as 316-396 C.E., Ui Hakuju places him in the fourth century (320-400 C.E.). Takakusu Junjiroo and Kimura Taiken gave 420 to 500, Wogihara Unrai gives 390 to 470 C.E., and Hikata Ryushoo gives 400 to 480 C.E. Erich Frauwallner suggests that there were two Vasubandhus and hence two different dates. According to him Vasubandhu the elder lived between about 320 and 380 C.E. and Vasubandhu the younger between around 400 and 480 C.E. However, this hypothesis of two Vasubandhus is no longer tenable in current scholarship as many of the early Chinese documents used by Frauwallner are of spurious nature and thus, their testimony cannot be accepted.

6. Writings of Vasubandhu

Vasubandhu is said to have been the author of one thousand works, 500 in the Hinayana tradition and 500 Mahayana treatises. But only forty-seven works of Vasubandhu are extant, nine of which survive in the Sanskrit original, twenty-seven in Chinese translation, and thirty-three in Tibetan translation. The Abhidharmakosha is the most voluminous among Vasubandhu's independent expositions. It attained the status of a primary textbook to be studied by all students of the tradition in the Northern Buddhist countries, including Tibet. As pointed out above, the Abhidharmakosha pictures the Buddhist Path to Enlightenment through the categorization and analysis of the seventy-five dharmas.

Vasubandhu's Karmasiddhi (Establishing Karma) is a short, quasi-Hinayana treatise coloured, as is the Abhidharmakosha, by Sautrantika leanings. His Pancaskandhaprakarana (Exposition on the Five Aggregates) discusses most of the subjects taken up in the Abhidharmakosha. In cataloguing and categorization of dharmas in the Pancaskandhaprakarana the dharmas is a bit different than the Abhidharmakosha. Moreover, whereas the Abhidharmakosha talks about seventy five dharmas, not only have several dharmas been added, but many of the original seventy five have been dropped in the Pancaskandhaprakarana.

In his Karmasiddhiprakarana (Exposition on Establishing Karma), Vasubandhu challenged the views of those who held that dharmas are anything other than being momentary. The doctrine of momentariness (kshanikavada) perceived consciousness as a causal sequence of moments in which each moment is caused by its immediate predecessor. However, he felt that this theory could not explain certain categories of continuity. For instance, kshanikavada did not offer any satisfactory explanation for the re-emergence of a consciousness stream after having been interrupted in deep sleep. Similarly, continuity from one life to the next could not be explained satisfactorily by this theory. To solve such inconsistencies, Vasubandhu introduced the Yogacara notion of the alaya vijnana (storehouse consciousness). Through this concept he explained that the seed (bija) of a previous experience is stored subliminally and released into a new experience. In this way, Vasubandhu not only explained continuity between two separate moments of consciousness, but he also provided a quasi causal explanation for the functioning of karmic retribution. In other words, Vasubandhu's alaya vijnana provided an explanation as to how an action performed at one time could produce its result at another time. This concept also did away with the necessity of a permanent atman as the doer and recipient of karma since, like a stream, it is continuously changing with new conditions from moment to moment.

From the Yogacara point of view the most important of Vasubandhu's works are the Vimshatika (Twenty Verses), Trimshika (Thirty Verses), and Trisvabhavanirdesha (Exposition on the Three Natures). According to tradition, the Trisvabhavanirdesha was reputedly his last treatise, and his Vimshatika and Trimshika were written near the end of his life, though we have no actual evidence to support this order. Despite the fact that all these three texts are very concise and the Trisvabhavanirdesha was not even known in China (and is never read in Tibet despite being part of Tibetan canon), they form a kind of troika and represent Vasubandhu's final accomplishment as a Yogacara-Vijnanavada teacher.

The Vimshatika is perhaps the most original and philosophically interesting treatise of Vasubandhu. Vasubandhu devotes a major portion of this text in dealing with the Realist objections against Yogacara. To the Realist position that external things must exist because they are consistently located in space as well as time, Vasubandhu responds by saying that objects also appear to have spatial and temporal qualities in dreams, whereas nothing ‘external' is present in the dreams. This means that the appearance of cognitive objects does not require an actual object external to the consciousness cognizing it. Vasubandhu, however, points out that without the consciousness nothing whatsoever can be apprehended. Therefore, it is consciousness that is the necessary condition and not an external object. Vasubandhu does not deny that cognitive objects exist. However, what he denies is that such cognitive objects have external reference points. From the Yogacara point of view, what we believe to be external objects are actually nothing more than mental projections. Thus, whatever we think about, know, experience, or conceptualize, occurs to us only in our consciousness and nowhere else. In other words, according to Vasubandhu, cognition takes place only in consciousness and nowhere else. Thus, everything that we know is acquired through sensory experience. We are fooled by consciousness into believing that those things which we perceive and appropriate within consciousness are actually outside our cognitive sphere. To the Realist objection that subjective wishes do not determine objective realities, Vasubandhu replies that due to collective-karma groups give rise to common misperceptions. He pointed out that it is the result of a person's own karma that determines the type of situation in which that person would be born. Thus, Vasubandhu points out that how we see things is shaped by previous experience, and since experience is inter-subjective, we gather in groups that see things the way we do. To another Realist objection that the objective world functions by determinate causal principles, Vasubandhu points out that the appearance of causal efficacy also occurs in dreams. Thus our conscious ‘dreams' can have causal efficacy.

The Trimshika, which became the basic text of the Faxiang (Japanese Hossoo) school, is one of Vasubandhu's most mature works. Through concise verses he sums up his doctrine of vijnapti matra (cognition only) by explaining Yogacara theories of eight-consciousnesses, three-natures and the five-step path to Enlightenment. The eight types of consciousness are the five sense consciousnesses, the empirical consciousness (mano-vijnana), a self-aggrandizing mentality (manas), and the alaya-vijnana. Vasubandhu describes and explains how each of these can be extinguished through ashraya-paravritti i.e., through the overturning of the very basis of these eight types of consciousness. This over-turning i.e., achievement of the Bodhi gradually takes place through the five-step path in a way that consciousness (vijnana) is transformed into unmediated cognition (jnana). According to the theory of three natures, there are three cognitive realms at play: the delusional cognitively constructed realm, which is intrinsically unreal; the realm of causal dependency; and the perfectional realm which is intrinsically ‘empty.' To Vasubandhu, Buddhism is a method of cleansing the stream of consciousness from ‘contaminations' and ‘defilements.’

The Foxinglun (Treatise on Buddha Nature) exerted great influence on Sino-Japanese Buddhism by propounding the concept of tathagata-garbha (Buddha Nature). The Vadavidhi (A Method for Argumentation) is another important text attributed to Vasubandhu. Though this text is not strictly speaking a ‘logic' text and does not make any distinction between techniques of debate and logic as such, still its importance in the field of logic cannot be overlooked. It not only provides information on the state of Buddhist logic prior to Dignaga, but also paved the way for the revolutionary contribution of Dignaga and Dharmakirti in the field of logic. Though not many details on the meditative career of Vasubandhu are available, his Madhyantavibhagabhashya (Commentary on the Separation of the Middle from Extremes) points to his keen interest in the techniques of meditation.

Vasubandhu's commentaries on sutras and shastras are by no means less important than the above-mentioned independent treatises. He wrote commentaries on three treatises: the Madhyantavibhaga (Discrimination between the Middle and the Extremes), Mahayanasutralamkara (Ornament of the Mahayana Sutras), and Dharmadharmatavibhaga/ Dharmadharmtavibhanga (Discrimination between Existence and Essence). All these three treatises are important texts of the Yogacara school and are ascribed to Asanga's teacher Maitreya. Vasubandhu also composed a commentary on Asanga's Mahayanasamgraha (Compendium of Mahayana). It is the first methodical presentation of the doctrines of Yogacara-Vijnanavada. Vasubandhu's Sukhavativyuhasutranirdesha (Commentary on the Sukhavativyuha Sutra) is another important text. This text became a fundamental treatise of the Pure Land faith in China and Japan. The Indian Yogacara-Vijnanavada is represented in China by three schools, and the development of all these schools is credited to the works of Vasubandhu. The first of these schools, called the Dilun school (which was established in the first half of the sixth century C.E.), took his Dashabhumikasutranirdesha (Commentary on the Dashabhumika Sutra) as its basic text. The second, the Shelun school which originated in the second half of the sixth century C.E., developed around a translation of the Mahayanasamgraha done by Paramartha. The third school, known as the Faxiang school (founded by Xuanzang and his disciple Kuiji in the seventh century), adopted the Trimshika as its basic text.

Later in life, Vasubandhu went so far ahead with his contemplative exercises that he even refused to engage in a debate with his worthy opponent Samghabhadra. He died at the age of eighty. Paramartha says that he died at Ayodhya, whereas Bu-ston says that his death took place in the northern frontier countries, which he calls ‘Nepal.' In recognition of his contribution and achievements as a Mahayana teacher, he came to be reverently called a bodhisattva in various traditions from India to China. In fact, some go to the extent of even calling him the ‘second Buddha.' As rightly pointed out in Bu-ston, he "was possessed of the wealth (vasu of the Highest wisdom and, having propagated the Doctrine out of mercy, had become the friend (bandhu) of the living beings."

7. References and Further Readings

  • Anacker, Steven. Seven Works of Vasubandhu. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1984.
  • Duerlinger, James. Indian Buddhist Theories of Person: Vasubandhu's Refutation of the Theory of a Self. London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2003.
  • Frauwallner, Erich. On the Date of the Buddhist Master of the Law, Vasubandhu. Rome: IsMeo, 1951.
  • Hall, Bruce C. "The Meaning of Vijnapti in Vasubandhu's Concept of Mind." Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies 9 (1986): 7-23.
  • Chimpa, Lama, and A. Chattopadhyaya, trans. Taranatha's History of Buddhism in India. Simla: Indian Institute of Advanced Study, 1970.
  • Jaini, Padmanabh S. "On the Theory of Two Vasubandhus." Bulletin of the School of Oriental and African Studies 21 (1958): 48-53.
  • Kaplan, Stefan. "A Holographic Alternative to a Traditional Yogacara Simile: An Analysis of Vasubandhu's Trisvabhava Doctrine." Eastern Buddhist 23 (1990): 56-78.
  • Kochumuttom, Thomas. A Buddhist Doctrine of Experience: A New Translation and Interpretation of the Works of Vasubandhu the Yogacarin. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1982.
  • Kritzer, Robert. "Vasubandhu on samapratyaya vijnanamam." Journal of the International Association of Buddhist Studies 16/1 (1993): 24-55.
  • Levi, Sylvain. Un systeme de philosophie bouddhique: Materiaux pour l`etude du systeme Vijnaptimatra.Paris: Bibliotheque de l`ecole des Hautes Etudes, fasc. 260, 1932.
  • Lusthaus, Dan. Buddhist Phenomenology: A Philosophical Investigation of Yogacara Buddhism and the Ch'eng wei shih lun. London: Curzon, 2000.
  • Obermiller, E., trans. The History of Buddhism in India and Tibet by Bu-Ston. 2nd rev. ed. Delhi: Sri Satguru Publications, 1986.
  • Poussin, Louis de la Vallee, trans. L'Abhidharmakosha de Vasubandhu. 6 vols. Bruxelles, 1971 [reprint].
  • Pruden, Leo, trans. Abhidharma Kosha Bhashyam. 4 vols. Berkeley: Asian Humanities Press, 1988-90.
  • Ryushoo, Hikata. "A Reconsideration on the Date of Vasubandhu." Bulletin of the Faculty of the Kyushu University 4 (1956): 53-74.
  • Takakusu, J. "A Study of Paramartha's Life of Vasubandhu and the Date of Vasubandhu." Journal of the Royal Asiatic Society (1905): 33-53.
  • Tola, Fernando, and Carmen Dragonetti, eds. "The Trisvabhavakarika of Vasubandhu." Journal of Indian Philosophy 11 (1983): 225-266.
  • Waldron, William S. The Buddhist Unconsciousness: The alaya-vijnana in the Context of Indian Buddhist Thought. London: RoutledgeCurzon, 2003.
  • Yamada, Isshi. "Vijnaptimatrata of Vasubandhu." Journal of the Royal Asiatic Society (1977): 158-176.

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K. T. S. Sarao
Delhi University

Carneades (c. 214–129 B.C.E.)

carneadesCarneades was perhaps the most prominent head of the skeptical Academy in ancient Greece. Following the example of Arcesilaus, who turned the Academy in a skeptical direction, Carneades developed an array of arguments against the dogmatic positions upheld by other philosophers, particularly the Stoics. He went beyond Arcesilaus in several respects, however. Instead of simply arguing against the positive positions of other philosophers, Carneades also set forth arguments of his own in favor of views that sometimes had never been defended before--not in order to establish their truth, but simply to counterbalance the arguments of the dogmatists and show that none of their conclusions can be conclusively established. In doing so, Carneades made important contributions to several philosophical debates. Carneades also set forth a more detailed skeptical criterion of what to believe, to pithanon which means either the "plausible" or the "probable."

Table of Contents

  1. Skeptical Practice
  2. Contributions to Philosophical Debates
  3. Practical Criterion: To Pithanon

1. Skeptical Practice

Carneades continued the skeptical academy's attack upon Stoic epistemology. Arcesilaus had argued against Zeno, the founder of Stoicism, that no sense-impressions could provide a firm foundation for knowledge, since sense-impressions are always fallible. Carneades maintained this criticism against refinements in the Stoics' theory made by Chrysippus, the head of the Stoa at his time. But Carneades went beyond criticizing the arguments of other philosophers by trying to propound equally convincing arguments for incompatible conclusions, which would have the effect of leaving his interlocutor suspending judgement as to which is true. For instance, while on a mission to Rome with the heads of two other philosophical schools, Carneades gave an eloquent defense of traditional views on justice one day, and the next day offered an equally eloquent attack on those same views. (Unamused traditionalist Romans expelled the philosophers from the city as a result.)

2. Contributions to Philosophical Debates

In arguing for contrary positions, Carneades sometimes came up with novel positions or arguments. For instance, Carneades gave a taxonomy of different possible candidates for what the highest good could be, and in so doing, came up with possibilities not canvassed by previous philosophers. He also defended original views in the debate between the Stoics and Epicureans on human freedom, determinism, and the truth-values of statements about the future. Against both Epicurus and the Stoics, Carneades argued that no deterministic consequences follow from the principle of bivalence (the principle that for any statement P, either P is true or P is false). That is because, even if it has always been true that e.g., I will brush my teeth tomorrow, that does not imply that there are "immutable eternal causes" which will bring it about that I will do so. It can be true now simply in virtue of the fact that brushing my teeth is actually what I will freely choose to do. Similarly, Carneades said that Epicureans can defend human freedom from causal determinism without positing a random atomic swerve. A person can be the cause of his actions by a "free movement of the mind", without there being antecedent causes that necessitate that the agent will do what he does. This is reminiscent of the theories of "agent-causation" later propounded by writers like Chisholm.

3. Practical Criterion: To Pithanon

Carneades also developed a detailed skeptical criterion, to pithanon--which can mean either "the plausible" or "the probable." Sense-impressions can never be a sure guide to truth, thought Carneades, but some are still more convincing to us than others--some seem plausible, and others not. We need not stop there however--we can make further investigation of convincing impressions to see if they stand up or not, as well as seeing whether they cohere with our other sense-impressions.

Exactly how to understand Carneades' criterion was controversial even in his own day. Carneades left no writings, other than a few letters, and Clitomachus, who was Carneades' closest associate and succeeded him as head of the Academy, said he did not know what Carneades really thought. Two questions are: (1) Are pithanon beliefs supposed to be more likely to be true (as Cicero and Philo thought), or simply more plausible to the person who accepts them? (2) Is Carneades advocating to pithanon in his own voice as a criterion that a skeptic could use, or is he simply employing it in service of his arguments against the Stoics, without being committed to it himself?

For more information on Carneades, see the section on him in the entry on ancient Greek skepticism.

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Arcesilaus (c. 315—240 B.C.E.)

Arcesilaus was the sixth head of Plato's academy. He turned the academy in a skeptical direction. After Plato's death, the headship of the academy passed to a series of men who developed metaphysical and ethical systems inspired by the positive arguments contained in dialogues such as the Republic and the Phaedo. Arcesilaus, however, turned away from such system-building and instead spent his energies in attacking the arguments of others. According to Cicero, the aim of such attacks was to produce epoche, or suspension of judgment.

Some later commentators claim that by making this skeptical turn, Arcesilaus abandoned Platonism. However, sympathetic writers like the academic skeptic Cicero assert that much of Plato's writings are actually more in harmony with Arcesilaus' practice than with dogmatic system-building. In dialogues like the Euthyphro and Laches, Socrates is shown questioning other people's definitions of terms such as piety and courage. In so doing, Socrates shows that they do not know what they think that they know. However, Socrates' questioning does not lead to positive answers to the questions he raises. In the Apology Socrates claims that he has no knowledge of his own, but that he is wiser than other people only insofar as he knows that he does not know, whereas others are ignorant even of their own ignorance. Arcesilaus goes beyond this, saying that he knows nothing, not even that that he knows nothing. Later academic skeptics like Cicero also stress the tentative and exploratory nature of dialogues like the Republic: although they do contain positive arguments, the dialogue form, the back-and-forth among the speakers, and Socrates' own disavowals at many points of having conclusively established what he argues for should make us wary of looking at the dialogues as treatises that expound Platonic doctrine.

The Stoics were the main target of Arcesilaus' attacks. The founder of Stoicism, Zeno of Citium, developed a systematic and elaborate metaphysics, ethics, and epistemology. Zeno claimed that there are certain sense-impressions—so-called kataleptic or "graspable" impressions—which are the foundation and criterion of knowledge. These impressions come from objects in the environment and accurately represent these objects. The Stoics also thought that the wise person would never assent to what is uncertain, and thus would never be mistaken. Arcesilaus argued that, according to the Stoics' own standards, the Stoic wise person would never assent to anything, since no sense-impression is ever infallible. For any sense-impression, Arcesilaus said, even if it is accurate, it is always possible in principle that there be a qualitatively indistinguishable sense-impression that is inaccurate, and the wise person would thus have no way of telling which sense-impressions are accurate andwhich ones are not.

The Stoics thought that without a criterion for knowledge, it would be impossible to have any basis on which to act. Arcesilaus, however, said that we can act on the basis the eulogon—the "reasonable." The eulogon is not a criterion of knowledge, since what is eulogon can be mistaken, but it can be a basis of action.

Arcesilaus left no writings of his own, so we must rely on second and third-hand reports in order to reconstruct his views. Even in ancient times, however, Arcesilaus' views were heavily debated. One major question is whether Arcesilaus himself thought that it is impossible to gain knowledge, or just that it is impossible, given the assumptions of the Stoics about the nature of knowledge. Similarly, it is not clear whether Arcesilaus advanced the eulogon as his own skeptical criterion for action, or whether he simply advanced it to rebut Stoic claims about the necessity of a criterion of knowledge for action.

For more information on Arcesilaus, see the section on him in the entry on ancient Greek skepticism.

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Damon (5th cn. B.C.E.)

Damon was a Pythagorean philosopher of Syracuse. Damon was a close friend to Phintias the Pythagorean. Dionysius, the tyrant, having condemned Phintias to death for conspiring against him, Phintias begged that leave might be allowed him to go for a short period to a neighboring place, in order to arrange some family affairs, and offered to leave one of his friends in the hands of Dionysius as a pledge for his return by an appointed time, and who would be willing, in case Phintias broke his word, to die in his stead. Dionysius, skeptical as to the existence of such friendship, and prompted by curiosity, assented to the arrangement, and Damon took the place of Phintias. The day appointed for the return of Phintias arrived, and the public expectation was highly excited as to the probable issue of this singular affair. The day drew to a close; no Phintias came; and Damon was in the act of being led to execution, when, of a sudden, the absent friend, who had been detained by unforeseen and unavoidable obstacles, presented imself to the eyes of the admiring crowd and saved the life of Damon. Dionysius was so much struck by this instance of true attachment that he pardoned Phintias, and entreated the two to allow him to share their friendship (Val. Max. iv. 7; Plut. De Amic Mult.).

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Aenesidemus (1st cn. C.E.)

Aenesidemus was the founder of Pyrrhonian Skepticism. He was born at Gnossus in Crete, but lived at Alexandria and flourished shortly after Cicero. Aenesidemus originally was a member of Plato's Academy. From the time of Arcesilaus through Carneades, at least, the Academy was skeptical. By the time of Aenesidemus, however, the Academy had splintered into several competing factions and considerably softened or even abandoned its skepticism, as a result of its dialectical interchange with the Stoics. One head of the Academy, Philo, turned to a form of moderate fallibilism, in which one could assent to many beliefs and gain knowledge, although not certainty, while a later head, Antiochus, propounded a dogmatic and syncretistic philosophy, claiming that at bottom Plato, the Stoics, and many other philosophers were really saying the same thing.

Aenesidemus complained that the situation had deteriorated to the point where the Academics were no more than "Stoics in conflict with Stoics," and he broke with the Academy and founded his own school, taking Pyrrho as its namesake. To strengthen the cause of skepticism, he developed the ten tropes or modes of skepticism—a set of skeptical argument forms, or modes, to show that judgment must be withheld on any issue. All are based on some form of relativity—e.g., the same object can give rise to different perceptions, depending on the bodily condition of the percipient--conjoined with the claim that there is no criterion by which to adjudicate which of the perceptions, customs, etc., are correct. Although Diogenes Laertius attributes the ten modes to Pyrrho, it is likely that they owe their existence to Aenesidemus. Extracts of the ten modes are found in Photius.

Briefly, the ten modes are as follows: (1) The feelings and perceptions of all living beings differ. (2) People have physical and mental differences, which make things appear different to them. (3) The different senses give different impressions of things. (4) Our perceptions depend on our physical and intellectual conditions at the time of perception. (5) Things appear different in different positions, and at different distances. (6) Perception is never direct, but always through a medium. For example, we see things through the air. (7) Things appear different according to variations in their quantity, color, motion, and temperature. (8) A thing impresses us differently when it is familiar and when it is unfamiliar. (9) All supposed knowledge is predication. All predicates give us only the relation of things to other things or to ourselves; they never tell us what the thing in itself is. (10) The opinions and customs of people are different in different countries.

For more information on Aenesidemus, see the section on him in the entry on Ancient Greek Skepticism.

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Democritus (460—370 B.C.E.)

democritusDemocritus was born at Abdera, about 460 BCE, although according to some 490. His father was from a noble family and of great wealth, and contributed largely towards the entertainment of the army of Xerxes on his return to Asia. As a reward for this service the Persian monarch gave and other Abderites presents and left among them several Magi. Democritus, according to Diogenes Laertius, was instructed by these Magi in astronomy and theology. After the death of his father he traveled in search of wisdom, and devoted his inheritance to this purpose, amounting to one hundred talents. He is said to have visited Egypt, Ethiopia, Persia, and India. Whether, in the course of his travels, he visited Athens or studied under Anaxagoras is uncertain. During some part of his life he was instructed in Pythagoreanism, and was a disciple of Leucippus. After several years of traveling, Democritus returned to Abdera, with no means of subsistence. His brother Damosis, however, took him in. According to the law of Abdera, whoever wasted his patrimony would be deprived of the rites of burial. Democritus, hoping to avoid this disgrace, gave public lectures. Petronius relates that he was acquainted with the virtues of herbs, plants, and stones, and that he spent his life in making experiments upon natural bodies. He acquired fame with his knowledge of natural phenomena, and predicted changes in the weather. He used this ability to make people believe that he could predict future events. They not only viewed him as something more than mortal, but even proposed to put him in control of their public affairs. He preferred a contemplative to an active life, and therefore declined these public honors and passed the remainder of his days in solitude.

Credit cannot be given to the tale that Democritus spent his leisure hours in chemical researches after the philosopher's stone -- the dream of a later age; or to the story of his conversation with Hippocrates concerning Democritus's supposed madness, as based on spurious letters. Democritus has been commonly known as "The Laughing Philosopher," and it is gravely related by Seneca that he never appeared in public with out expressing his contempt of human follies while laughing. Accordingly, we find that among his fellow-citizens he had the name of "the mocker". He died at more than a hundred years of age. It is said that from then on he spent his days and nights in caverns and sepulchers, and that, in order to master his intellectual faculties, he blinded himself with burning glass. This story, however, is discredited by the writers who mention it insofar as they say he wrote books and dissected animals, neither of which could be done well without eyes.

Democritus expanded the atomic theory of Leucippus. He maintained the impossibility of dividing things ad infinitum. From the difficulty of assigning a beginning of time, he argued the eternity of existing nature, of void space, and of motion. He supposed the atoms, which are originally similar, to be impenetrable and have a density proportionate to their volume. All motions are the result of active and passive affection. He drew a distinction between primary motion and its secondary effects, that is, impulse and reaction. This is the basis of the law of necessity, by which all things in nature are ruled. The worlds which we see -- with all their properties of immensity, resemblance, and dissimilitude -- result from the endless multiplicity of falling atoms. The human soul consists of globular atoms of fire, which impart movement to the body. Maintaining his atomic theory throughout, Democritus introduced the hypothesis of images or idols (eidola), a kind of emanation from external objects, which make an impression on our senses, and from the influence of which he deduced sensation (aesthesis) and thought (noesis). He distinguished between a rude, imperfect, and therefore false perception and a true one. In the same manner, consistent with this theory, he accounted for the popular notions of Deity; partly through our incapacity to understand fully the phenomena of which we are witnesses, and partly from the impressions communicated by certain beings (eidola) of enormous stature and resembling the human figure which inhabit the air. We know these from dreams and the causes of divination. He carried his theory into practical philosophy also, laying down that happiness consisted in an even temperament. From this he deduced his moral principles and prudential maxims. It was from Democritus that Epicurus borrowed the principal features of his philosophy.

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Demonax (2nd cn. C.E.)

Demonax was a philosopher of the second century CE. who tried to revive the philosophy of the Cynic School. Born in Cyprus, Demonax went to Athens, where he became so popular that people vied with on another in presenting him with food, and even the young children gave him great quantities of fruit. Much less austere than Diogenes, whom he took as his philosophic model, he nevertheless rebuked vice unsparingly, and was charged with neglecting the Eleusinian Mysteries, to which he replied: "If the mysteries are bad, no one should be initiated; and if they are good, they ought to be open to everyone." He was friend of Epictetus, who once rebuked him for not marrying, but was silenced by Demonax, who said, "Very well; give me one of your daughters for a wife" -- Epictetus being himself a bachelor. Demonax lived to be nearly a hundred, and on his death was buried with great magnificence. See the Demonax of Lucian, in which the character of the philosopher is painted in glowing colors.

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Denis Diderot (1713—1784)


Denis Diderot was the most prominent of the French Encyclopedists. He was educated by the Jesuits, and, refusing to enter one of the learned professions, was turned adrift by his father and came to Paris, where he lived from hand to mouth for a time. Gradually, however, he became recognized as one of the most powerful writers of the day. His first independent work was the Essai sur le merite et la vertu (1745). As one of the editors of the Dictionnaire de medecine (6 vols., Paris, 1746), he gained valuable experience in encyclopedic system. His Pensees philosophiques (The Hague, 1746), in which he attacked both atheism and the received Christianity, was burned by order of the Parliament of Paris.

In the circle of the leaders of the Enlightenment, Diderot's name became known especially by his Lettre sur les aveugles (London, 1749), which supported Locke's theory of knowledge. He attacked the conventional morality of the day, with the result (to which possibly an allusion to the mistress of a minister contributed) that he was imprisoned at Vincennes for three months. He was released by the influence of Voltaire's friend Mme. du Chatelet, and thenceforth was in close relation with the leaders of revolutionary thought. He had made very little pecuniary profit out of the Encyclopedie, and Grimm appealed on his behalf to Catherine of Russia, who in 1765 bought his library, allowing him the use of the books as long as he lived, and assigning him a yearly salary which a little later she paid him for fifty years in advance.

In 1773 she summoned him to St. Petersburg with Grimm to converse with him in person. On his return he lived until his death in a house provided by her, in comparative retirement but in unceasing labor on the undertakings of his party, writing (according to Grimm) two-thirds of Raynal's famous Histoire philosophique, and contributing some of the most rhetorical pages to Helvetius's De l'esprit and Holbach's Systeme de la nature Systeme social, and Alorale universelle. His numerous writings include the most varied forms of literary effort, from inept licentious tales and comedies which pointed away from the stiff classical style of the French drama and strongly influenced Lessing, to the most daring ethical and metaphysical speculations. Like his famous contemporary Samuel Johnson, he is said to have been more effective as a talker than as a writer; and his mental qualifications were rather those of a stimulating force than of a reasoned philosopher. His position gradually changed from theism to deism, then to materialism, and finally rested in a pantheistic sensualism. In Sainte-Beuve's phrase, he was " the first great writer who belonged wholly and undividedly to modern democratic society," and his attacks on the political system of France were among the most potent causes of the Revolution.

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Diogenes Laertius (3rd cn. C.E.)

Diogenes Laertius, native of Laerte in Cilicia, was a biographer of ancient Greek philosophers. His Lives of the Philosophers (Philosophoi Biol), in ten books, is still extant and is an important source of information on the development of Greek philosophy. The period when he lived is not exactly known, but it is supposed to have been during the reigns of Septimius Severus and Caracalla. Because of his long and fairly sympathetic account of Epicurus, some think that Diogenes belonged to the Epicurean School, but this is not clear. He expresses his admiration for many philosophers, but his own allegiances, if any, are not stated.

He divides all the Greek philosophers into two classes: those of the Ionic and those of the Italic school. He derives the first from Anaximander, the second from Pythagoras. After Socrates, he divides the Ionian philosophers into three branches: (a) Plato and the Academics, down to Clitomachus; (b) the Cynics, down to Chrysippus; (c) Aristotle and Theophrastus. The series of Italic philosophers consists, after Pythagoras, of the following: Telanges, Xenophanes, Parmenides, Zeno of Elea, Leucippus, Democritus, and others down to Epicurus. The first seven books are devoted to the Ionic philosophers; the last three treat of the Italic school.

The work of Diogenes is a crude contribution towards the history of philosophy. It contains a brief account of the lives, doctrines, and sayings of most persons who have been called philosophers; and though the author is limited in his philosophical abilities and assessment of the various schools, the book is valuable as a collection of facts, which we could not have learned from any other source, and is entertaining as a sort of pot-pourri on the subject. Diogenes also includes samples of his own wretched poetry about the philosophers he discusses.

Diogenes is generally as reliable as whatever source he happens to be copying from at that moment. Especially when Diogenes is setting down amusing or scandalous stories about the lives and deaths of various philosophers which are supposed to serve as fitting illustrations of their thought, the reader should be wary. The article on Epicurus, however, is quite valuable, since it contains some original letters of that philosopher, which comprise a summary of the Epicurean doctrines.

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Parmenides (b. 510 B.C.E.)

Parmenides-imgParmenides was a Greek philosopher and poet, born of an illustrious family about B.C.E. 510, at Elea in Lower Italy, and is is the chief representative of the Eleatic philosophy. He was held in high esteem by his fellow-citizens for his excellent legislation, to which they ascribed the prosperity and wealth of the town. He was also admired for his exemplary life. A "Parmenidean life" was proverbial among the Greeks. He is commonly represented as a disciple of Xenophanes. Parmenides wrote after Heraclitus, and in conscious opposition to him, given the evident allusion to Hericlitus: "for whom it is and is not, the same and not the same, and all things travel in opposite directions" (fr. 6, 8). Little more is known of his biography than that he stopped at Athens on a journey in his sixty-fifth year, and there became acquainted with the youthful Socrates. That must have been in the middle of the fifth century BCE., or shortly after it.

Parmenides broke with the older Ionic prose tradition by writing in hexameter verse. His didactic poem, called On Nature, survives in fragments, although the Proem (or introductory discourse) of the work has been preserved. Parmenides was a young man when he wrote it, for the goddess who reveals the truth to him addresses him as "youth." The work is considered inartistic. Its Hesiodic style was appropriate for the cosmogony he describes in the second part, but is unsuited to the arid dialectic of the first. Parmenides was no born poet, and we must ask what led him to take this new departure. The example of Xenophanes' poetic writings is not a complete explanation; for the poetry of Parmenides is as unlike that of Xenophanes as it well can be, and his style is more like Hesiod and the Orphics. In the Proem Parmenides describes his ascent to the home of the goddess who is supposed to speak the remainder of the verses; this is a reflexion of the conventional ascents into heaven which were almost as common as descents into hell in the apocalyptic literature of those days.

The Proem opens with Parmenides representing himself as borne on a chariot and attended by the Sunmaidens who have quitted the Halls of Night to guide him on his journey. They pass along the highway till they come to the Gate of Night and Day, which is locked and barred. The key is in the keeping of Dike (Right), the Avenger, who is persuaded to unlock it by the Sunmaidens. They pass in through the gate and are now, of course, in the realms of Day. The goal of the journey is the palace of a goddess who welcomes Parmenides and instructs him in the two ways, that of Truth and the deceptive way of Belief, in which is no truth at all. All this is described without inspiration and in a purely conventional manner, so it must be interpreted by the canons of the apocalyptic style. It is clearly meant to indicate that Parmenides had been converted, that he had passed from error (night) to truth (day), and the Two Ways must represent his former error and the truth which is now revealed to him.

There is reason to believe that the Way of Belief is an account of Pythagorean cosmology. In any case, it is surely impossible to regard it as anything else than a description of some error. The goddess says so in words that cannot be explained away. Further, this erroneous belief is not the ordinary man's view of the world, but an elaborate system, which seems to be a natural development the Ionian cosmology on certain lines, and there is no other system but the Pythagorean that fulfils this requirement. To this it has been objected that Parmenides would not have taken the trouble to expound in detail a system he had altogether rejected, but that is to mistake the character of the apocalyptic convention. It is not Parmenides, but the goddess, that expounds the system, and it is for this reason that the beliefs described are said to be those of 'mortals'. Now a description of the ascent of the soul would be quite incomplete without a picture of the region from which it had escaped. The goddess must reveal the two ways at the parting of which Parmenides stands, and bid him choose the better. The rise of mathematics in the Pythagorean school had revealed for the first time the power of thought. To the mathematician of all men it is the same thing that can be thought and that can be, and this is the principle from which Parmenides starts. It is impossible to think what is not, and it is impossible for what cannot be thought to be. The great question, Is it or is it not? is therefore equivalent to the question, Can it be thought or not?

In any case, the work thus has two divisions. The first discusses the truth, and the second the world of illusion -- that is, the world of the senses and the erroneous opinions of mankind founded upon them. In his opinion truth lies in the perception that existence is, and error in the idea that non-existence also can be. Nothing can have real existence but what is conceivable; therefore to be imagined and to be able to exist are the same thing, and there is no development. The essence of what is conceivable is incapable of development, imperishable, immutable, unbounded, and indivisible. What is various and mutable, all development, is a delusive phantom. Perception is thought directed to the pure essence of being; the phenomenal world is a delusion, and the opinions formed concerning it can only be improbable.

Parmenides goes on to consider in the light of this principle the consequences of saying that anything is. In the first place, it cannot have come into being. If it had, it must have arisen from nothing or from something. It cannot have arisen from nothing; for there is no nothing. It cannot have arisen from something; for here is nothing else than what is. Nor can anything else besides itself come into being; for there can be no empty space in which it could do so. Is it or is it not? If it is, then it is now, all at once. In this way Parmenides refutes all accounts of the origin of the world. Ex nihilo nihil fit.

Further, if it is, it simply is, and it cannot be more or less. There is, therefore, as much of it in one place as in another. (That makes rarefaction and condensation impossible.) it is continuous and indivisible; for there is nothing but itself which could prevent its parts being in contact with on another. It is therefore full, a continuous indivisible plenum. (That is directed against the Pythagorean theory of a discontinuous reality.) Further, it is immovable. If it moved, it must move into empty space, and empty space is nothing, and there is no nothing. Also it is finite and spherical; for it cannot be in one direction any more than in another, and the sphere is the only figure of which this can be said. What is is, therefore a finite, spherical, motionless, continuous plenum, and there is nothing beyond it. Coming into being and ceasing to be are mere 'names', and so is motion, and still more color and the like. They are not even thoughts; for a thought must be a thought of something that is, and none of these can be.

Such is the conclusion to which the view of the real as a single body inevitably leads, and there is no escape from it. The 'matter' of our physical text-books is just the real of Parmenides; and, unless we can find room for something else than matter, we are shut up into his account of reality. No subsequent system could afford to ignore this, but of course it was impossible to acquiesce permanently in a doctrine like that of Parmenides. It deprives the world we know of all claim to existence, and reduces it to something which is hardly even an illusion. If we are to give an intelligible account of the world, we must certainly introduce motion again somehow. That can never be taken for granted any more, as it was by the early cosmologists; we must attempt to explain it if we are to escape from the conclusions of Parmenides.

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Prodicus (fl. 5th c. B.C.E.)

Prodicus was a sophist and rhetorician from Iulis on the island of Ceos. He was contemporary with Democritus and Gorgias, and was a disciple of Protagoras. He flourished in the 86th Olympiad, and it is reported that his disciples included Socrates, Euripides, Theramenes, and Isocrates. His countrymen, after giving him several public jobs, sent him as ambassador to Athens. He was so well received there that he was induced to open a school of rhetoric. In his lectures on literary style he laid stress on the right use of words and the accurate discrimination between synonyms. Plato frequently satirizes him as a pedantic lecturer on the niceties of language. Plato also insinuates that the prospect of wealth prompted Prodicus to open his school, and indeed his lectures seem to have brought him much money. Philostratus also notes that Prodicus was fond of money. He used to go from one city to another displaying his eloquence, and, though he did it in a mercenary way, he nevertheless had great honors paid to him in Thebes and Lacedaemon. His charge to a pupil was fifty drachmae. Aristophanes, however, describes him as the most remarkable of the natural philosophers for wisdom and character. It is reported that people flocked to hear Prodicus, although he had an unpleasant sounding voice. It also related that Xenophon, when a prisoner in Boeotia, desiring to hear Prodicus, came up with the required bail and went and gratified his curiosity (Philostr. l. c.). None of his lectures has come down to us in its original form. His most famous work is The Choice of Hercules, and was frequently cited. The original is lost, but the substance of it is in Xenophon's Memorabilia(2:1:21). Prodicus was put to death by the Athenians on the charge of corrupting their youth. Sextus Empiricus ranks him among the atheists, and Cicero remarks that some of his doctrines were subversive of all religion. It is said that he explained the origin of religion by the personification of natural objects.

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Pyrrho (c. 360—c. 270 B.C.E.)

PyrrhoPyrrho was a Greek philosopher from Elis, and founder of the Greek school of skepticism. In his youth he practiced the art of painting, but passed over this for philosophy. He studied the writings of Democritus, became a disciple of Bryson, the son of Stilpo, and later a disciple of Anaxarchus. He took part in the Indian expedition of Alexander the Great, and met with philosophers of the Indus region. Back in Greece he was frustrated with the assertions of the Dogmatists (those who claimed to possess knowledge), and founded a new school in which he taught fallibilism, namely that every object of human knowledge involves uncertainty. Thus, he argued, it is impossible ever to arrive at the knowledge of truth (Diog. Laert, 58). It is related that he acted on his own principles, and carried his skepticism to such an extreme, that his friends were obliged to accompany him wherever he went, so he might not be run over by carriages or fall down precipices. It is likely, though, that these reports were invented by the Dogmatists whom he opposed. He spent a great part of his life in solitude, and was undisturbed by fear, or joy, or grief. He withstood bodily pain, and when in danger showed no sign of apprehension. In disputes he was known for his subtlety. Epicurus, though no friend to skepticism, admired Pyrrho because he recommended and practiced the kind of self-control that fostered tranquillity; this, for Epicurus, was the end of all physical and moral science. Pyrrho was so highly valued by his countrymen that they honored him with the office of chief priest and, out of respect for him, passed a decree by which all philosophers were made immune from taxation. He was an admirer of poets, particularly Homer, and frequently cited passages from his poems. After his death, the Athenians honored his memory with a statue, and a monument to him was erected in his own country.

Pyrrho left no writings, and we owe our knowledge of his thoughts to his disciple Timon of Phlius. His philosophy, in common with all post-Aristotelian systems, is purely practical in its outlook. Skepticism is not posited on account of its speculative interest, but only because Pyrrho sees in it the road to happiness, and the escape from the calamities of life. The proper course of the sage, said Pyrrho, is to ask himself three questions. Firstly we must ask what things are and how they are constituted. Secondly, we ask how we are related to these things. Thirdly, we ask what ought to be our attitude towards them. As to what things are, we can only answer that we know nothing. We only know how things appear to us, but of their inner substance we are ignorant. The same thing appears differently to different people, and therefore it is impossible to know which opinion is right. The diversity of opinion among the wise, as well as among the vulgar, proves this. To every assertion the contradictory assertion can be opposed with equally good grounds, and whatever my opinion, the contrary opinion is believed by somebody else who is quite as clever and competent to judge as I am. Opinion we may have, but certainty and knowledge are impossible. Hence our attitude to things (the third question), ought to be complete suspense of judgment. We can be certain of nothing, not even of the most trivial assertions. Therefore we ought never to make any positive statements on any subject. And the Pyrrhonists were careful to import an element of doubt even into the most trifling assertions which they might make in the course of their daily life. They did not say, "it is so," but "it seems so," or "it appears so to me." Every observation would be prefixed with a "perhaps," or "it may be."

This absence of certainty applies as much to practical as to theoretical matters. Nothing is in itself true or false. It only appears so. In the same way, nothing is in itself good or evil. It is only opinion, custom, law, which makes it so. When the sage realizes this, he will cease to prefer one course of action to another, and the result will be apathy (ataraxia). All action is the result of preference, and preference is the belief that one thing is better than another. If I go to the north, it is because, for one reason or another, I believe that it is better than going to the south. Suppress this belief, learn that the one is not in reality better than the other, but only appears so, and one would go in no direction at all. Complete suppression of opinion would mean complete suppression of action, and it was at this that Pyrrho aimed. To have no opinions was the skeptical maxim, because in practice it meant apathy, total quietism. All action is founded on belief, and all belief is delusion, hence the absence of all activity is the ideal of the sage. In this apathy he will renounce all desires, for desire is the opinion that one thing is better than another. He will live in complete repose, in undisturbed tranquillity of soul, free from all delusions. Unhappiness is the result of not attaining what one desires, or of losing it when attained. The wise person, being free from desires, is free from unhappiness. He knows that, though people struggle and fight for what they desire, vainly supposing some things better than others, such activity is but a futile struggle about nothing, for all things are equally indifferent, and nothing matters. Between health and sickness, life and death, difference there is none. Yet insofar as we are compelled to act, we will follow probability, opinion, custom, and law, but without any belief in the essential validity or truth of these criteria.

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Pythagoras (c. 570—c. 495 B.C.E)

PythagorasThe pre-Socratic Greek philosopher Pythagoras must have been one of the world's greatest persons, but he wrote nothing, and it is hard to say how much of the doctrine we know as Pythagorean is due to the founder of the society and how much is later development. It is also hard to say how much of what we are told about the life of Pythagoras is trustworthy; for a mass of legend gathered around his name at an early date. Sometimes he is represented as a man of science, and sometimes as a preacher of mystic doctrines, and we might be tempted to regard one or other of those characters as alone historical. The truth is that there is no need to reject either of the traditional views. The union of mathematical genius and mysticism is common enough. Originally from Samos, Pythagoras founded at Kroton (in southern Italy) a society which was at once a religious community and a scientific school. Such a body was bound to excite jealousy and mistrust, and we hear of many struggles. Pythagoras himself had to flee from Kroton to Metapontion, where he died.

It is stated that he was a disciple of Anaximander, his astronomy was the natural development of Anaximander's. Also, the way in which the Pythagorean geometry developed also bears witness to its descent from that of Miletos. The great problem at this date was the duplication of the square, a problem which gave rise to the theorem of the square on the hypotenuse, commonly known still as the Pythagorean proposition (Euclid, I. 47). If we were right in assuming that Thales worked with the old 3:4:5 triangle, the connection is obvious.

Pythagoras argued that there are three kinds of men, just as there are three classes of strangers who come to the Olympic Games. The lowest consists of those who come to buy and sell, and next above them are those who come to compete. Best of all are those who simply come to look on. Men may be classified accordingly as lovers of wisdom, lovers of honor, and lovers of gain. That seems to imply the doctrine of the tripartite soul, which is also attributed to the early Pythagoreans on good authority, though it is common now to ascribe it to Plato. There are, however, clear references to it before his time, and it agrees much better with the general outlook of the Pythagoreans. The comparison of human life to a gathering like the Games was often repeated in later days. Pythagoras also taught the doctrine of Rebirth or transmigration, which we may have learned from the contemporary Orphics. Xenophanes made fun of him for pretending to recognize the voice of a departed friend in the howls of a beaten dog. Empedocles seems to be referring to him when he speaks of a man who could remember what happened ten or twenty generations before. It was on this that the doctrine of Recollection, which plays so great a part in Plato, was based. The things we perceive with the senses, Plato argues, remind us of things we knew when the soul was out of the body and could perceive reality directly.

There is more difficulty about the cosmology of Pythagoras. Hardly any school ever professed such reverence for its founder's authority as the Pythagoreans. 'The Master said so' was their watchword. On the other hand, few schools have shown so much capacity for progress and for adapting themselves to new conditions. Pythagoras started from the cosmical system of Anaximenes. Aristotle tells us that the Pythagoreans represented the world as inhaling 'air' form the boundless mass outside it, and this 'air' is identified with 'the unlimited'. When, however, we come to the process by which things are developed out of the 'unlimited', we observe a great change. We hear nothing more of 'separating out' or even of rarefaction and condensation. Instead of that we have the theory that what gives form to the Unlimited is the Limit. That is the great contribution of Pythagoras to philosophy, and we must try to understand it. Now the function of the Limit is usually illustrated from the arts of music and medicine, and we have seen how important these two arts were for Pythagoreans, so it is natural to infer that the key to its meaning is to be found in them.

It may be taken as certain that Pythagoras himself discovered the numerical ratios which determine the concordant intervals of the musical scale. Similar to musical intervals, in medicine there are opposites, such as the hot and the cold, the wet and the dry, and it is the business of the physician to produce a proper 'blend' of these in the human body. In a well-known passage of Plato's Phaedo (86 b) we are told by Simmias that the Pythagoreans held the body to be strung like an instrument to a certain pitch, hot and cold, wet and dry taking the place of high and low in music. Musical tuning and health are alike means arising from the application of Limit to the Unlimited. It was natural for Pythagoras to look for something of the same kind in the world at large. Briefly stated, the doctrine of Pythagoras was that all things are numbers. In certain fundamental cases, the early Pythagoreans represented numbers and explained their properties by means of dots arranged in certain 'figures' or patterns.

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MenippusMenippus, an adherent of the Cynic School of philosophy, was a Greek philosopher of Gadara in Syria, who flourished about 250 BCE. He was born at Sinope in Asia Minor, but his family was originally from Gadara, in Palestine. According to Diogenes Laertius, he was at first a slave, but afterward obtained his freedom by purchase, and eventually succeeded, by dint of money, in obtaining citizenship at Thebes. Here he pursued the employment of a money lender, and obtained from this the title "one who lends money at daily interest". Having been defrauded, and having lost, in consequence, all his property, he hung himself in despair. Menippus was the author of several works, now completely lost; they satirized the follies of human kind, especially of philosophers, in a sarcastic tone Among other productions, he wrote a piece entitled "The Sale of Diogenes," and another called "Necromancy." They were a medley of prose and verse, and became models for the satirical works of Varro (hence called Saturae Menippeae. It is suggested that the Necromancy inspired an imitator of Lucian to compose the "Menippus, or Oracle of the Dead," which is found among the works of the native of Samosata.

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Leucippus (5th cn. B.C.E.)

Leucippus was the founder of Atomism. We know next to nothing about his life, and his book appears to have been incorporated in the collected works of Democritus. No writer subsequent to Theophrastos seems to have been able to distinguish his teaching from that of his more famous disciple. Indeed his very existence has been denied, though on wholly insufficient grounds.

Aristotle gives a clear and intelligible account of the way Leucippus' theory arose. It originated from Parmenides' denial of the void, from which the impossibility of multiplicity and motion had been deduced. Leucippus supposed himself to have discovered a theory which would avoid this consequence. He admitted that there could be no motion if there was no void, and he inferred that it was wrong to identify the void with the non-existent. Leucippus was the first philosopher to affirm, with a full consciousness of what he was doing, the existence of empty space. The Pythagorean void had been more or less identified with 'air', but the void of Leucippus was really a vacuum.

Besides space there was body, and to this Leucippus ascribed all the characteristics of Parmenides notion of the real. The assumption of empty space, however, made it possible to affirm that there was an infinite number of such reals, invisible because of their smallness, but each possessing all the marks of the Parmenidean One, and in particular each indivisible like it. These moved in the empty space, and their combinations can give rise to the things we perceive with the senses. Pluralism was at least stated in a logical and coherent way. Democritus compared the motions of the atoms of the soul to that of the particles in the sunbeam which dart hither and thither in all directions even when there is no wind, and we may fairly assume that he regarded the original motion of the other atoms in much the same way.

The atoms are not mathematically indivisible like the Pythagorean monads, but they are physically indivisible because there is no empty space in them. Theoretically, then, there is no reason why an atom should not be as large as a world. Such an atom would be much the same thing as the Sphere of Parmenides, were it not for the empty space outside it and the plurality of worlds. As a matter of fact, however, all atoms are invisible. That does not mean, of course, that they are all the same size; for there is room for an infinite variety of sizes below the limit of the minimum visible. Leucippus explained the phenomenon of weight from the size of the atoms and their combustions, but he did not regard weight itself as a primary property of bodies. Aristotle distinctly says that none of his predecessors had said anything of absolute weight and lightness, but only of relative weight and lightness, and Epicurus was the first to ascribe weight to atoms. Weight for the earlier atomists is only a secondary phenomenon arising, in a manner to be explained, from excess of magnitude. It will be observed that in this respect the early atomists were far more scientific than Epicurus and even than Aristotle. The conception of absolute weight has no place in science, and it is really one of the most striking illustrations of the true scientific instinct of the Greek philosophers that no one before Aristotle ever made use of it, and Plato expressly rejected it.

The first effect of the motion of the atoms is that the larger atoms are retarded, not because they are 'heavy', but because they are more exposed to impact than the smaller. In particular, atoms of an irregular shape become entangled with one another and form groups of atoms, which are still more exposed to impact and consequent retardation. The smallest and roundest atoms, on the other hand, preserve their original motions best, and these are the atoms of which fire is composed. In an infinite void in which an infinite number of atoms of countless shapes and sizes are constantly impinging upon one another in all directions, there will be an infinite number of places where a vortex motion is set up by their impact. when this happens, we have the beginning of a world. It is not correct to ascribe this to chance, as later writers do. It follows necessarily from the presuppositions of the system. The solitary fragment of Leucippus we possess is to the effect that 'Naught happens for nothing, but all things from a ground (logos) and of necessity'.

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Peter Lombard (1095-1160)

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Sentences
  3. Analysis of the Sentences

1. Life

Peter Lombard, a scholastic theologian of the twelfth century, was commonly known as "the Lombard" after his birthplace which actually was probably Novara. It is expected that he then moved to Lombardy approximately after his birth in 1105-1110 CE He died in Paris, France about 1160 (1164). Although his family was poor, he found powerful patrons such as St. Bernard, that enabled him to gain a higher education at Bologna, then at Reims in France, and finally in Paris. In Paris, Peter taught theology in the cathedral school of Notre Dame, and it was there he found the time to produce the works discussed later in this article. Their dates can be only approximately fixed. The most famous of them, the Libri quatuor sententiarum , was probably composed between 1147 and 1150, although it may be placed as late as 1155. Nothing is certainly known of his later life except that be became bishop of Paris in 1159. According to Walter of St. Victor, a hostile witness, Peter obtained the office by simony; the more usual story is that Philip, younger brother of Louis VII. and archdeacon of Paris, was elected but declined in favor of Peter, his teacher. The date of his death can not be determined with certainty. The ancient epitaph in the church of St. Marcel at Paris assigns it to 1164, but the figures seem to be a later addition. The demonstrable fact that Maurice of Sully was bishop before the end of 1160 seems conclusive against it, although it is possible that in that year he resigned his see and lived three or four years longer.

2. The Sentences

The historic importance of Peter Lombard rests on his Sentences and the position taken by them in medieval philosophy. The earlier dogmatic theologians, such as Isidore of Seville, Alcuin, and Paschasius Radbert, had attempted to establish the doctrine of the Church from Bible texts and quotations from the Fathers. In the eleventh century this method gave place to dialectical and speculative working over of the traditional dogmas. Peter Lombard came into the field at a time when the now methods and their dialectical artifices were still exposed to wide-spread objection, but when the thirst for knowledge was exceedingly keen. One text-book after another was being published, the majority of them either issuing from the school of Abelard, or in some degree inspired by him. Of these works the greatest influence was attained by that of Peter, which was, for the time, an admirable compendium of theological knowledge. It is written under the influence preeminently of Abelard, Hugo of St. Victor, and the Decretum of Gratian. Whether Peter had himself seen the early writers whom he cites is frequently uncertain. As to his contemporaries, whom he knew thoroughly, he shows the influence of Abelard in his whole method and in countless details, while preserving a critical attitude toward his most pronounced peculiarities. On the other hand, he follows Hugo very closely and often textually, though here also with a tendency to avoid the purely speculative elements. For his sacramental doctrine, Gratian is very useful, especially through the quotations adduced by him and his legal attitude toward these questions.

3. Analysis of the Sentences

The first book of the Sentences deals, principally from a cosmological standpoint, with the evidences for the existence of God. For the doctrine of the Trinity he appeals to the analogies used since Augustine. However, he denies that any real knowledge of the doctrine can be obtained from these analogies without positive revelation and faith, and emphasizing the fact that human speech cannot give a satisfactory account of the nature of God. Joachim of Flore asserted that Peter changed the Trinity into a quaternity, and the charge was investigated at the Lateran Council of 1215. The basis of this charge was the manner in which he distinguished the divine substance from the three persons. Lombard asserted, as a realist, the substantive reality of this common substance. Joachim accused him of adding this substance to the three persons, but Innocent III. and the council decided that he was perfectly orthodox. The relation between the prescience of God and events is conceived in such a way that neither that which happens is the actual ground of the foreknowledge nor the latter of the former, but each is to the other a causa sine qua non . Predestination is thus, as a divine election, the preparation of grace and the foreknowledge and preparation of the blessings of God, through which man is justified. There is no such thing as merit antecedent to grace, not even in the sense that man can merit not to be cast away. The omnipotence of God consists in this, that he does what he wills and suffers nothing. A distinction is made between the absolute uncaused will of God, which is always accomplished, and what may be called his will in a loose sense. To thesigna beneplaciti , the signs of the latter, including commands, prohibitions, counsels, operations, permissions, results do not always correspond-" for God commanded Abraham to sacrifice his son, yet did not will it to be done."

The second book of the Sentences deals with creation and the doctrine of the angels. Peter, following Hugo, considers the " image " and " likeness " of God as distinct, but does not decide for any of the three explanations of this distinction which he quotes. He rejects the traducianist theory of the origin of the human soul. He calls the will free, inasmuch as it " has power to desire and choose, without coercion or necessity, what it has decreed on grounds of reason," but he denies Abelard's theory that the moral character of an act depends on the will of the doer. Of some importance is the strong emphasis laid upon the actually sinful character of the nature derived from Adam, in conjunction with the condemnation of Abelard's proposition that " we inherit from Adam not guilt but penalty." In regard to grace he shows some independent thought, which had its influence on later teaching. Grace (gratia operans) is a power (virtus) which frees and heals the will, enabling it to perform good and meritorious works. Of grace and the will, grace is the more important. The third book deals with Christology, reproducing the traditional orthodox conceptions, but showing some influence from Abelard. One portion of this discussion brought him into suspicion of Nihilianism. He was accused by John of Cornwall and Walter of St. Victor, and more than one council took up the question without reaching a conclusion. The charge of Nestorianisn, which Gerhoh of Reichersberg brought against the Christology of his time, was made also against the Lombard. In regard to the atonement, he endeavored both to follow out the accepted system of his day and to make use of suggestions from Abelard. Christ merited glorification by his life, and by his death man's entrance into Paradise, his liberation from sin and its penalty and from the power of the devil. Christ as man is a perfect and sufficient sacrifice to achieve reconciliation, through the revelation of God's love made in his death; " the death of Christ then justifies us, when by it love is awakened in our hearts." Further, Christ sets man free from eternal punishment relaxando debitum; but to set man free from the temporal punishment, which is remitted in baptism and mitigated by penance, " the penances laid upon those who repent by the Church would not suffice unless the penalty borne by Christ were added to release us." There is a lack of clearness about this whole subject; the ideas of Abelard (Anselm is not noticed) show themselves now and again through all the effort to preserve the objective notion of the work of redemption.

The fourth book deals with the sacraments. Here Peter follows Hugo and the Decretum of Gratian; and his teaching was of great significance for the later development. He was probably the first to make a distinct classification of seven and only seven sacraments; he laid down the dogmatic questions to be discussed under the head of each, and he introduced matter from church law into his discussion of the sacramental dogma. In regard to the Eucharist, he speaks of the " conversion " of one substance into the other, without defining any further, and denies both the symbolic view and the consubstantiation taught by some followers of Berengar. In his doctrine of penance he follows Abelard in seeking theoretical justification for the change which by this time had taken place in the practice.

In spite of the cautious objectivity of the whole treatment, some of the propositions laid down in the Sentences were considered erroneous in after years. Walter of St. Victor asserts that at the Lateran council of 1179 it was proposed to condemn the Sentences but other matters prevented a discussion of the proposal. From the middle of the thirteenth century the University of Paris refused its assent to eight propositions, of a highly technical character, it is true, and Bonaventure declined to press them. Others were afterward added; but these objections did not interfere with the general popularity of the work, which had increased to such an extent by Roger Bacon's time (1267) that he could complain that lectures on it had forced those on Scriptural subjects into the background. Besides the " Sentences," other extant works of Peter Lombard are Commentarius in psalmos Davidicos and Collectanea in omnes D. Paitli epistolas both collections, in the manner of medieval Catenae, of quotations from patristic and early medieval theologians, with occasional independent remarks. A few unpublished manuscripts, some of them of doubtful authenticity, remain in various places. Of these the most important for a complete knowledge of the author are two manuscripts, one early thirteenth century, the other fourteenth, in the Bibliotheque Nationale at Paris, containing twenty-five festival sermons representing. a moderate type of medieval mystical theology, dominated by allegorical exegesis, but making some excellent practical points.

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James Frederick Ferrier (1808—1864)


Table of Contents

  1. Life the Writings
  2. Philosophy

1. Life the Writings

James Frederick Ferrier was born in Edinburgh on June 16, 1808, the son of John Ferrier, writer to the signet. Ferrier was educated by the Reverend H. Duncan, at the manse of Ruthwell, Dumfriesshire; and afterwards at Edinburgh High School, and under Dr. Charles Parr Burney, son of Dr. Charles Burney (1757-1817), at Greenwich. He was at the university of Edinburgh from 1825-1827, and then became a fellow-commoner of Magdalen College, Oxford, where he graduated BA. in 1831. He formed in the same year the acquaintance of Sir William Hamilton, whose influence upon him was very great, and for whose personal character and services to speculation he expresses the highest reverence. For years together he was almost daily in Hamilton's company for hours. In 1832 he became an advocate, but apparently never practiced. His metaphysical tastes, stimulated by Hamilton's influence, led him to spend some months at Heidelberg in 1834, in order to study German philosophy. He was on intimate terms with his aunt, Miss Ferrier, and his uncle, John Wilson, and in 1837 married his cousin, Margaret Anne, eldest daughter of John Wilson. He became a contributor to Blackwood's Magazine." He there wrote an article on Coleridge's plagiarisms in 1840. His first metaphysical publication was a series of papers, reprinted in his Remains, called "An Introduction to the Philosophy of Consciousness," in Blackwood's Magazine for 1838 and 1839.

In 1842 he was appointed professor of civil history in the university of Edinburgh; and in 1844-5 he lectured as William Hamilton's substitute. In 1845 he was elected professor of moral philosophy and political economy at St. Andrews. He was a candidate for the professorship of moral philosophy, resigned by Wilson in 1852, and for the professorship of logic and metaphysics vacated by Hamilton's death in 1856. But he was unsuccessful on both occasions, and continued at St. Andrews until his death. His chief work, the Institutes of Metaphysic, was published in 1854. The theory which it upholds had been already expounded to his class. It reached a second edition in 1856. In the same year he replied to his critics in a vigorous pamphlet called Scottish Philosophy, the Old and New, which, with certain omissions, is published as an "Appendix to the Institutes" in his Remains. He thought that the misunderstandings of his previous exposition had told against his candidature for the chair of metaphysics. Ferrier devoted himself to his professorial duties at St. Andrews; wrote and carefully rewrote his lectures, and lived chiefly in his study. He could seldom be persuaded to leave St. Andrews even for a brief excursion. An attack of angina pectoris in November 1861 weakened him permanently, though he continued to labor, and gave lectures in his own house. Renewed attacks followed in 1863, and he died at St. Andrews on June 11, 1864. After his death his minor publications were collected and published together along with a series of lectures as Lectures on Greek Philosophy and other philosophical remains (1866).

2. Philosophy

Ferrier provides the earliest, and in some ways the most impressive, statement of absolute idealism in English philosophy. As an historian of philosophy Ferrier did not pretend to exceptional research; but he had an ability to give a living presentation of their views. The history of philosophy was, for him, no mere record of discarded systems but "philosophy itself taking its time." He was a sympathetic student of the German philosophers, banned by his friend Hamilton. It is difficult to trace any direct influence of Hegel upon his own doctrine, and indeed he said that he could not understand Hegel. But both his earlier and his later writings have an affinity with Fichte -- especially in their central doctrine: the stress laid on self-consciousness, and its distinction from the "mental states" with which the psychologist is concerned. This doctrine connects him with Berkeley also. He was one of the first to appreciate the true nature of Berkeley's thought, as not a mere transition-stage between Locke and Hume, but as a discovery of the spiritual nature of reality.

In an essay on "Berkeley and Idealism," published in 1842, perhaps Ferrier's most perfect piece of philosophical writing, he signalizes both the essential truth and the essential defect in a theory which was at the time much less understood than it is now. Berkeley, he says, "certainly was the first to stamp the indelible impress of his powerful understanding on those principles of our nature, which, since his time, have brightened into imperishable truths in the light of genuine speculation. His genius was the first to swell the current of that mighty stream of tendency towards which all modern meditation flows, the great gulf-stream of Absolute Idealism." The element o peculiar value in Berkeley's speculation is its concreteness, its faithfulness to reality.

The peculiar endowment by which Berkeley was distinguished, far beyond almost every philosopher who has succeeded him, was the eye he had for facts, and the singular pertinacity with which he refused to be dislodged from his hold upon them. . . . No man ever delighted less to expatiate in the regions of the occult, the abstract, the impalpable, the fanciful, and the unknown. His heart and soul clung with inseparable tenacity to the concrete realties of the universe; and with an eye uninfluenced by spurious theories, and unperverted by false knowledge, he saw directly into the very life of things.

His theory needs only to be widened, and thus corrected, to provide the true explanation of which philosophy is in search. How this is to be done, is more clearly stated in the Institutes.

He saw that something subjective was a necessary and inseparable part of every object of cognition. But instead of maintaining that it was the ego or oneself which clove inseparably to all that could be known, and that this element must be thought of along with all that is thought of, he rather held that it was the senses, or our perceptive modes of cognition, which clove inseparably to all that could be known, and that these required to be thought of along with all that could be thought of. These, just as much as the ego, were held by him to be the subjective part of the total synthesis of cognition which could not by any possibility be discounted. Hence the unsatisfactory character of his ontology, which, when tried by the test of a rigorous logic, will be found to invest the Deity -- the supreme mind, the infinite ego, which the terms of his system necessarily compel him to place in synthesis with all things -- with human modes of apprehension, with such senses as belong to man -- and to invest Him with these, not as a matter of contingency, but as a matter these, not as a matter of necessity. Our only safety lies in the consideration -- a consideration which is a sound, indeed inevitable logical inference -- that our sensitive modes of apprehension are mere contingent elements and conditions of cognition; and that the ego or subject alone enters, of necessity, into the composition of everything which any intelligence can know.

Although there are occasional references to Kant in Ferrier's works, he develops his theory through a continuous criticism of Reid, on the one hand, and of Hamilton, on the other. Reid is, for him, the representative of Psychology or the "science of the human mind," and therefore, despite his own protestations to the contrary, of "Representationism." Hamilton is the representative of Agnosticism, or the doctrine of the unknowableness of the Absolute Reality. Against the former view, he argues that we have a direct knowledge of Reality, both material and spiritual; against the latter, he formulates his "agnoiology" or "theory of ignorance," to prove that the "ignorance" of which Hamilton would convict the human mind is not properly called ignorance or defect, but is simply that repudiation of the unintelligible or self-contradictory which is the essential characteristic of intelligence, rather than a defect peculiar to the human mind.

The fundamental error of Psychology is the acceptance of sensation, or the "state of consciousness," as the original datum of knowledge, the consequence being that the inference to the existence of the object, as well as to the subject, is more or less uncertain. As a matter of fact, the subject and the object are inseparable. "Matter per se" is never the object of knowledge; what we perceive is always "Matter mecum." The elementary fact of knowledge is not matter, but the perception of matter, or the subject as conscious of the object, either subjective or objective. Mere "phenomena" never exist; what exists is always phenomenal to a self or subject. If we define "substance" as that which is capable of existing, or of being conceived, alone and independently, then the conscious self, that is, the subject as conscious of an object, is substance, and can be known. The ego cannot know objects without knowing itself along with them; it cannot know itself except along with objects. It is because the psychologists have ignored the conscious, or rather the self-conscious self, which is present in all knowledge, that they have been unable to escape the conclusion that all we know is "ideas" or "phenomena" which represent, and may misrepresent, the object or substantial reality.

For the refutation of the Hamiltonian doctrine of the Relativity of Knowledge, Ferrier formulated what he regarded as an entirely original "theory of ignorance." Ignorance, he holds, presupposes the possibility of knowledge; we can be ignorant only of that which it is possible for us to know. It is not a defect, but a merit of knowledge not to know that which cannot be known because it is the unintelligible or the self-contradictory. Now we have seen that subject and object, or mind and matter, per se, are both alike unknowable in this sense; since they are never presented in consciousness alone but always together, it follows that they cannot be represented or thought in separation from one another. It is of such an inconceivable or unintelligible reality that Hamilton proclaims that ignorance is inevitable; he might as well proclaim the unknowableness of Nothing, or of Nonsense. It is the glory, rather than the humiliation, of intelligence to repudiate the unintelligible or self-contradictory.

On the basis of this "epistemology" and "agnoiology" Ferrier proceeds to construct his "ontology." Self-conscious mind, the ultimate element in knowledge, is also the ultimate element in existence. Repudiating the errors of subjective idealism, he finds himself compelled to accept absolute or objective idealism. The individual ego, along with the universe of his thought, is not independent. "The only independent universe which any mind or ego can think of is the universe in synthesis with some other mind or ego." And since one such other mind is sufficient to account for the universe of our experience, we are warranted in inferring that there is only one. Ferrier thus summarizes the argument which yields "this theistic conclusion":

Speculation shows us that the universe, by itself, is the contradictory; that it is incapable of self-subsistency, that it can exist only cum alio, that all true and cogitable and non-contradictory existence is a synthesis of the subjective and the objective; and then we are compelled, by the most stringent necessity of thinking, to conceive a supreme intelligence as the ground and essence of the Universal Whole. Thus the postulation of the Deity is not only permissible, it is unavoidable. Every mind thinks, and must think of God (however little conscious it may be of the operation which it is performing), whenever it thinks of anything as lying beyond all human observation, or as subsisting in the absence or annihilation of all finite intelligences.

The ethical implications of such an idealism are strikingly suggested in the Philosophy of Consciousness, where the parallelism between the functions of self-consciousness in the intellectual and in the moral spheres is made clear, and it is shown that "just as all perception originates in the antagonism between consciousness and our sensations, so all morality originates in the antagonism between consciousness and the passions, desires, or inclinations of the natural man." It is in this refusal to accept the guidance of the natural passions and inclinations, this "direct antithesis" of the "I" to the "natural man," that our moral freedom consists. What is this supreme act by which man asserts his supremacy over nature, within and without himself?

What is it but the act of consciousness, the act of becoming "I," the act of placing ourselves in the room which sensation and passion have been made to vacate? This act may be obscure in the extreme, but still it is an act of the most practical kind, both in itself and in its results. . . . For what act can be more vitally practical than the act by which we realize our existence as free personal beings? and what act can be attended by a more practical result than the act by which we look our passions in the face, and, in the very act of looking at them, look them down?

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Immanuel Hermann Fichte (1797—1879)

Fichte_I_HGerman philosopher, son of Johann Gottlieb Fichte b. at Jena July 18, 1797- d. at Stuttgart Aug. 8, 1879. He was for many years a gymnasial professor at Saarbrucken and Dusseldorf, and then professor of philosophy at Bonn 1836-42 (ordinary professor after 1840), and at Tubingen 1842-63. In 1863 he retired from the university and soon afterward settled in Stuttgart. He edited his father's works, founded and edited the Zeitschrift fur Philosophie und spekulative Theologie, and was a prolfic writer on philosophy. In metaphysics his position was that of a mediator between the two conflicting views represented by Hegel and Herbart, and, too, in the interest of theology. His great aim was to secure a philosophical basis for the personality of God. Taking the monadology of Leibniz as the model of a system embracing unity in plurality and plurality in unity, he sought to fuse extreme spiritualistic monism and extreme pluralistic realism into what he called concrete theism. The more important of his independent works are, Beitrdge zur Charakteristik der rteuern Philosophie (Sulzbach, 1829; 2d ed., completely rewritten, 1841); Religion und Philosophie (Heidelberg, 1834); Die speculative Theologie (3 parts, 1846); System der Ethik (2 vols., Leipsic, 1850-53); Anthropologie (18-56); Vermischte Schriften (2 vols., 1869); Die theistische Weltansicht und ihre Berechtigung (1873); and Der neuere Spiritualismus (1878).

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William Hamilton (1788—1856)


Table of Contents

Life and Writings

Scottish philosopher, born at Glasgow March 8, 1788, died at Edinburgh May 6, 1856. He studied first in Glasgow University, where his father had been professor of anatomy and botany; took a course in medicine at the University of Edinburgh in 1806-07; and in May, 1807, entered Balliol College, Oxford (B.A., 1811; M.A., 1814), where he concentrated upon classics and philosophy and gained the reputation of being the most learned Aristotelian in the university. In 1813 he settled in Edinburgh as an advocate, though he never secured a large practice. In 1820 he established his claim to the baronetcy of Preston, and was thenceforth known as Sir William. In the same year he was defeated for the chair of moral philosophy at the University of Edinburgh by John Wilson (Christopher North), but was elected to the professorship of civil history in 1821. About 1826 he took up the study of phrenology, and in 1826 and 1827 he read before the Royal Society of Edinburgh several papers antagonistic to the alleged science. He made his reputation as a philosopher by a series of articles that began to appear in the Edinburgh Review in 1829. In 1836 he was elected to the chair of logic and metaphysics in the University of Edinburgh, and held the position till his death. In 1843 he contributed to the lively ecclesiastical controversy of the time by publishing a pamphlet against the principle of non-intrusion. He was answered by William Cunningham. In July, 1844, he suffered a stroke of paralysis, which made him practically an invalid for the rest of his life.

Hamilton's principal works are: Discussions on Philosophy and Literature, Education and University Reform (London, 1852), containing his articles published in the Edinburgh ReviewNotes and Dissertations, published with his edition of T. Reid's Works (2 vols., Edinburgh, 1846-63); and his Lectures on Metaphysics and Logic (ed. H. L. Mansel and J. Veitch, 4 vols., 1859-60), of which an abridgment of the metaphysical portion (vols. i. and ii.) was edited by F. Bowen (Boston, 1870).

Philosophy Views

Hamilton was an exponent of the Scottish common-sense philosophy and a conspicuous defender and expounder of Thomas Reid, though under the influence of Kant he went beyond the traditions of the common-sense school, combining with a naive realism a theory of the relativity of knowledge. His psychology, while marking an advance on the work of Reid and Stewart, was of the " faculty " variety and has now been largely superseded by other views. His contribution to logic was the now well-known theory of the quantification of the predicate, by which he became the forerunner of the present algebraic school of logicians.

It is his law of the conditioned, with his correlative philosophy of the unconditioned, which comes into nearest relation with theology. This law is " that all that is conceivable in thought lies between two extremes, which, as contradictory of each other, can not both be true, but of which, as mutually contradictory, one must be true. . . . The law of the mind, that the conceivable is in every relation bounded by the inconceivable, I call the law of the conditioned." This involved his position that the Infinite is "incognizable and inconceivable." This doctrine on its philosophic side is a protest against Kant's skeptical result affirming that reason lands in hopeless contradictions; on its theological side it proclaims the impossibility of knowing the Absolute Being. Only by taking first the philosophic aspect can we correctly interpret its theological relations. Kant had made a priori elements only forms of the mind; and accordingly, the ideas of self, the universe, and God, became only regulative of our intellectual procedure, and in no sense guaranties of truth. Accordingly, Kant has dwelt on " the self-contradiction of seemingly dogmatical cognitions (the cum antithesi) in none of which we can discover any decided superiority." These were, that the world had a beginning, that it had not; that every composite substance consists of simple parts, that no composite thing does consist of simple parts; that causality according to the laws of nature is not the only causality operating to originate the world, that there is no other causality; that there is an absolutely necessary being, that there is not any such being. Hamilton's object was to maintain that such contradictions are not the product of reason, but of an attempt to press reason beyond its proper limits. If, then, we allow that the conceivable is only of the relative and bounded, we recognize at once that the so-called antinomies of reason are the result of attempts to push reason beyond its own province, to make our conceptions the measure of existence, attempting to bring the incomprehensible within the limits of comprehension.

Thus far a real service was rendered by Hamilton in criticizing the skeptical side of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. He estimated this result so highly as to say of it, " if I have done anything meritorious in philosophy, it is in the attempt to explain the phenomena of these contradictions." At this point Hamilton ranks Reid superior to Kant; the former ending in certainty, the latter in uncertainty. But there remain for Hamilton's philosophy the questions: If we escape contradiction by refusing to attempt to draw the inconceivable within the limits of conception, what is the source of certainty as to the infinite? How are knowledge and thought related to the existence and attributes of the Infinite Being? Here Hamilton is entangled in the perplexity of affirming certainty which is yet unknowable. That there is an Absolute Being, source of all finite existence, is, according to him, a certainty; but that we can have any knowledge of the fact is by him denied. Reid had maintained the existence of the Supreme Being as a necessary truth; and Hamilton affirms that the divine existence is at least a natural inference; but he nevertheless holds that the Deity can not be known by us. This is with him an application of the law of the conditioned-a conclusion inevitable under admission that all knowledge implies the relative, the antithesis of subject and object. This doctrine of ignorance was developed by H. L. Mansel, and eagerly embraced by the experientialists, J. S. Mill and Herbert Spencer. This gave an impulse to Agnosticism, the influence of which must be largely credited to Kant, who reduced the a priori to a form of mental procedure, and to Hamilton, who rejected Kant's view, yet regarded the absolute as incognizable. However, while insisting that " the infinite God can not by us, in the present limitation of our faculties, be comprehended or conceived," Hamilton adds that "faith-belief is the organ by which we apprehend what is beyond our knowledge."

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Karl Robert Eduard Von Hartmann (1842—1906)

HartmannGerman philosopher, born at Berlin Feb. 23, 1842, died at the same place June 5, 1906. He was educated at the school of artillery in Berlin (1859-1862); and held a commission (1860-65), when he was compelled to retire on account of serious knee trouble. He took his degree at Rostock in 1867, returned to Berlin, and retired to Lichterfelde (5 m. s.w. of Berlin) in 1885, doing most of his work in bed while suffering great pain. After developing the thought for twenty-two years, he began in 1864 to prepare his main philosophical work, Philosophie des Unbewussten (Berlin, 1869; llth ed., 3 vols., 1904). Next in rank was his Das sittliche Bewusstsein, appearing first as Phenomenologie des sittlichen Bewusstseins (Berlin, 1879); and next to that was the Religionsphilosophie (2 vols., Das religiose Bewusstein der Menschheit and Die Religion des Geistes, 1882).

The object of his philosophy was to unite the "idea" of Hegel with the "will" of Schopenhauer in his doctrine of the Absolute Spirit, or, as he preferred to characterize it, spiritual monism. He held that " a will which does not will something is not." The world was produced by will and idea, but not as conscious; for consciousness, instead of being essential, is accidental to will and idea-the two poles of " the Unconscious." Matter is both idea and will. In organic existences, in instinct, in the human mind, on the field of history, the unconscious will acts as though it possessed consciousness, that is, as though it were aware of the ends and of the infallible means for their realization. Consciousness arises from the active will and the will's opposition to this condition. Because of the wisdom displayed in the action of the Unconscious, this is the best possible world; only this does not prove that the world is good, or that the world would not be better, the latter of which is true. Human life labors under three illusions: (1) that happiness is possible in this life, which came to an end with the Roman Empire; (2) that life will be crowned with happiness in another world, which science is rapidly dissipating; (3) that happy social well-being, although postponed, can at last be realized on earth, a dream which will also ultimately be dissolved. Man's only hope lies in "final redemption from the misery of volition and existence into the painlessness of non-being and non-willing." No mortal may quit the task of life, but each must do his part to hasten the time when in the major portion of the human race the activity of the Unconscious shall be ruled by intelligence, and this stage reached, in the simultaneous action of many persons volition will resolve upon its own non-continuance, and thus idea and will be once more reunited in the Absolute.

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Claude Adrien Helvetius (1715—1771)


French philosopher; born in Paris January, 1715; died there Dec. 26, 1771. He studied at the College Louis-le Grand, and in 1738 received the lucrative post of farmer-general, which, however, he soon exchanged for the position of chamberlain to the queen. Tiring of the idle and dissipated life of the court, he married in 1751, and retired to a small estate at Vore, in Perche, where he devoted himself chiefly to philosophical studies. He visited England in 1764, and the following year he went to Germany, where he was received with distinction by Frederick II. He was one of the Encyclopedists, and held the skeptical and materialistic views common to that school of philosophy. His principal works are: De l'esprit (Paris, 1758; Eng. transl., De l'Esprit: or, Essays on the Mind, London, 1759), which, condemned by the Sorbonne and publicly burned at Paris, was translated into most European languages, and read more than any other book of the time; and the posthumous De l'homme, de ses facultes intellectuelles et de son Mucation (2 vols., London, 1772; Eng. transl., A Treatise on Man; his Intellectual Faculties and his Education, 2 vols.).

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Edward Herbert of Cherbury (1583—1648)


Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Writings
  3. Truth
  4. Deism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Life

Edward Herbert, was born at Eyton in Shropshire on March 3, 1583. He is the representative of a branch of the noble Welsh family of that name, and the elder brother of George Herbert the poet. He matriculated at University College, Oxford, in 1595, married in 1599, and continued to reside at Oxford till about 1600, when he removed to London. He was made a Knight of the Bath soon after the accession of King James. From 1608 to 1618 he spent most of his time on the continent as a soldier of fortune, occasionally seeking the company of scholars in the intervals of his campaigns, chases, or duels. In 1619 he was appointed ambassador at Paris; after his recall in 1624 King James rewarded him with an Irish peerage. He was created an English peer as Baron Herbert of Cherbury in 1629. The civil war found him unprepared for decision; but he ultimately saved his property by siding with the parliament. He died in London on 20 August 1648.

2. Writings

His works were historical, literary, and philosophical. His account of the Duke of Buckingham's expedition an his history of Henry VIII were written with a view to royal favor. The latter was published in 1649; a Latin version of the former appeared in 1658, the English original not till 1860. His literary works -- poems and autobiography -- are of higher merit. His poems were published by his son in 1665, and his autobiography was first printed by Horace Walpole in 1764. His philosophical works give him a distinct place in the history of thought. His greatest work, De Veritate, was, he tells us, begun in England and "formed there in all its principal parts.." Hugo Grotius, to whom he submitted the manuscript, advised its publication; but it was not till this advice had been sanctioned (as he thought) by a sign from heaven that he had the work printed (Paris, 1624). To the third edition (London, 1645) he added a short treatise De Causis Errorum, a dissertation entitled Religio Laici, and an Appendix ad Sacerdotes. In 1663 appeared his De Religione Gentilium -- a treatise on what is now called comparative religion. A popular account of his views on religion was published in 1768 under the title; although the external evidence is incomplete, it may have been from his pen.

3. Truth

Herbert does not stand in the front rank of speculative thinkers; but his claims as a philosopher are worthy of note. Like Francis Bacon he was occupied with the question of method; and his inquiry went deeper, though it was less effective upon philosophical opinion. Bacon investigated the criteria and canons of evidence, whereas Herbert sought to determine the nature and standard of truth. Descartes soon afterwards referred to the question and put it aside, saying of Herbert: "he examines what truth is; for myself, I have never doubted about it, as it seems to me to be a notion so transcendentally clear that it is impossible to ignore it" (letter of Oct. 16, 1639). The problem which Herbert put before himself concerned the conditions of knowledge; and it has bearing upon later thought, though it arises out of traditional views. In the end of the following century Kant said that his own new point of view was due to discarding the belief that "all our cognitions must conform to objects," which had been "hitherto assumed." This was, indeed the prevailing doctrine. Perception was held to be a "passio mentis" produced by the activity of the object which impressed its image (or, to use the term which Descartes and Locke made familiar, an idea) upon the mind. this view was rejected by Herbert as decidedly as by Kant, though he did not anticipate the Kantian revolution by assuming that "objects must conform to our cognition."

The distinction between mind and body had not yet been sharpened and turned into antagonism by the Cartesian dualism. Man is a complex of mind and body, and, according to Herbert, all that is passive in him is body (De Veritate, 3rd ed., p. 72). -- though body itself is not purely passive. Mind, however, is never passive. It acts but is not acted upon (ibid. p. 95). Things do not act upon it but are put within the sphere of its operation (ibid. p. 95). Nevertheless, it requires an occasion, or the presence of objects, to awaken its activity, even in its highest operations (ibid. p. 91). Herbert's expressions are not quite consistent, for this awakening of mental activity is itself an effect upon mind; but perhaps he might have defended his doctrine by appealing to the harmony which exists between faculty and object. For in this lies his fundamental conception -- different alike from the traditional view that cognition must conform to objects, and from the Kantian view that objects must conform to cognition. the mental faculty supplies a form analogous to the object as it exists (ibid. p. 97); the object, again,, neither undergoes an alteration of nature nor produces one, but only enters, as it were, into the faculty's range of view. The whole process is only intelligible on the supposition of a harmony between the world and the human mind. In this harmony the human body, fashioned out of the material of the external world and containing the sense-apparatus which lead to the "inner court" of consciousness, forms the bond of union.

Herbert's doctrine of the nature of truth rests on this conception of harmony. "Truth," he says, "is a certain harmony between objects and their analogous faculties" (ibid. p. 68). Four kinds or degrees of truth are distinguished by him: truth of the thing; truth of appearance; truth of concept; and truth of intellect. These seem to be arranged in an ascending scale. The first does not exclude the others; the last includes all the preceding, being the 'conformity' of the several 'conformities' they involve. The conditions of truth are also made to explain the possibility of error, for the causes of error lie in the intermediate stages between the thing and the intellect. The root of all error is in confusion -- in the inappropriate connection of faculty and object -- and it is for the intellect to expose the inappropriate connection and so to dissipate the error.

The doctrine arrived at is summed up in seven propositions (ibid. pp. 8-12); and all these hinge upon the postulate that mind corresponds with things not only in their general nature but in all their differences of kind, generic and specific. Every object is cognate to some mental power or faculty, and to every difference in the object there corresponds a different faculty. Herbert attempts no account of nature, and his psychology is only introduced in the interests of his doctrine of truth; but it is clear that there cannot be fewer faculties than there are differences of things. A faculty is defined as any internal force which unfolds a different mode of apprehension (sensus) to a different object (ibid. p. 30); and faculties are spoken of as radii animae, which perceive objects, or rather the image given out by objects, in accordance with mutual analogy. These images may be conveyed by the same sense-apparatus and yet be apprehended by different faculties, as is the case with figure and motion (ibid. p. 78). Hence countless faculties; but their very multiplicity suggests that Herbert cannot have attributed to them the same degree of independence as did the 'faculty-pschologists' of a recent generation. They may be said to be simply modes of mental operation; and mind operates differently as different kinds of objects are brought before it, showing always an aspect of its cognitive power analogous to the object.

Reflecting upon the various modes of mental activity, we may arrange these faculties into four classes: natural instinct, internal sense, external sense, and discourse or reasoning. These are not separate powers; and, although Herbert may have sometimes spoken of them as such, another doctrine may be found in his writings. According to this doctrine all mental faculty is regarded as informed in less or greater measure by the intellect, which is itself a manifestation in humans of the universal divine providence. "Our mind," he says, "is the highest image and type of the divinity, and hence whatever is true or good in us exists in supreme degree in God. Following out this opinion, we believe that the divine image has also communicated itself to the body. but, as in the propagation of light there is growing loss of distinctness as it gets farther from its source, so that divine image, which shines clearly in our living and free unity, first communicates itself to natural instinct or the common reason of its providence, then extends to the numberless internal and external faculties (analogous to particular objects), closes into shade and body, and sometimes seems as it were to retreat into matter itself" (ibid. p. 78).

The name 'natural instinct' is badly chosen; but it is not difficult to see what Herbert means by it. In particular, it is the home of those 'common notions' (as he calls them) which may be said to underlie all experience and to belong to the nature of intelligence itself. Some of these common notions are formed without any assistance from discourse or the ratiocinative faculty; others are only perfected by the aid of discourse. The former class is distinguished by certain tests or marks. Some of these tests are logical (such as independence, certainty, and necessity); others are psychological (such as priority in time and universality). but it is the last-named mark or "universal consent" that is made by him "the highest rule of natural instinct (ibid. p. 60), and "the highest criterion of truth" (ibid. p. 39).

This appeal to universal consent makes Herbert a precursor of the philosophy of Common Sense, and lays him open to the criticism urged by Locke that there are no truths which can satisfy the test, there being nothing so certain or so generally known that it has not been ignored or denied by some. Herbert made little if any use of the tests by which he might have shown that certain common notions are presupposed in the constitution of experience, and thus failed to carry out the theory of knowledge of which at times he had a clear view.

4. Deism

The common notions are practical as well as theoretical -- yield the first principles of morals as well as those of science. but he attempted no complete account of them and limited his investigation o the common notions of religion. To this portion of his work his direct influence as a thinker is chiefly due, for it determined the scope and character of the English Deistical movement. The common notions of religion are, he holds, the following: (1) that there is a supreme Deity; (2) that this Deity ought to be worshipped; (3) that virtue combined with piety is the chief part of divine worship; (4) that men should repent of their sins and turn from them; (5) that reward and punishment follow from the goodness and justice of God, both in this life and after it. These five articles contain the whole doctrine of the true catholic church, that is to say, of the religion of reason. They also formed the primitive religion before the people "gave ear to the covetous and crafty sacerdotal order." What is contrary to the 'five points' is contrary to reason and therefore false; what is beyond reason but not contrary to it may be revealed: but the record of a revelation is not itself revelation but tradition; and the truth of a tradition depends upon the narrator and can never be more than probable.

A separate work -- De Religione Gentilium -- was devoted to the verification of these results on the field of what is now called comparative religion. In respect of this work the claim may be justly made for Herbert that he was one of the first -- if not the first -- to make a systematic effort after a comparative study of religions. but he had no idea of the historical development of belief, and he looked upon all actual religions -- in so far as they went beyond his five articles -- as simply corruptions of the pure and primitive rational worship.

5. References and Further Reading

  • De Veritate, Prout distinguitur a Revelatione, a Verisimili, a Possibili, et a Falso (1633)
  • De Causis Errorum, De Religione Laici, Appendix ad Sacerdotes (1645)
  • Expeditio in ream Insulam (1656)
  • De Religione Gentilium Errorumque apud Eos Causis (1663)
  • A Dialogue between a Tutor and his Pupil (1768)
  • The Life of Edward Lord Herbert of Cherbury, Written by Himself (1764)

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Hippias (fl. 5th cn. B.C.E.)

A Greek sophist of Elis and a contemporary of Socrates. He taught in the towns of Greece, especially at Athens. He had the advantage of a prodigious memory, and was deeply versed in all the learning of his day. He attempted literature in every form which was then extant. He also made the first attempt in the composition of dialogues. In the two Platonic dialogues named after him (Hippias Major and Hippias Minor), he is represented as excessively vain and arrogant.

Hippias is chiefly memorable for his efforts in the direction of universality. He was the enemy of all specialization, and appeared at Olympia gorgeously attired in a costume entirely of his own making down to the ring on his finger. He was prepared to lecture to anyone on anything, from astronomy to ancient history. Such a man had need of a good memory, and we know that he invented a system of mnemonics. There was a more serious side to his character, however. This was the age when people were still optimistic of squaring the circle by a geometrical construction. The lunules of Hippocrates of Chios belong to it, and Hippias, the universal genius, could not be left behind here. He invented the curve still known as the quadratix, which would solve the problem if it could be mechanically described. Hippias appears to have originated the idea of natural law as the foundation of morality, distinguishing nature from the arbitrary conventions or fashions, differing according to the different times or regions in which they arise, imposed by arbitrary human enactment, and often unwillingly obeyed. He held that there is an element of right common to the laws of all countries and constituting their essential basis. He held also that the good and wise of all countries are naturally akin and should regard one another as citizens of a single state. This idea was subsequently developed by the Cynic and still more by the Stoic schools, passing from the latter to the jurists, in whose hands it became the great instrument for converting Roman law into a legislation for a people.

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Shadworth Hodgson (1832—1912)

Shadworth Hodgson's life was an example of rare devotion to philosophy. He had no profession and filled no public office, but spent his time in systematic reflection and writing; and his long life gave him the opportunity of reviewing, confirming, and improving upon his first thoughts. There were two periods in his activity. In the former of these he published three books: Time and Space in 1865, The Theory of Practice in 1870, and The Philosophy of Reflection in 1878. Shortly thereafter he was instrumental in founding 'the Aristotelian Society for the systematic study of philosophy,' and he remained its president for fourteen years. This led to contact with other minds who looked at the same subjects from different points of view. He read many papers to the society, which were published in pamphlet form and in its Proceedings, and he built up his own system afresh in the light of familiar criticism. It took final form in The Metaphysic of Experience, a work of four volumes published in 1898.

As an analysis of experience, Hodgson's philosophy falls into line with a characteristic English tradition. It agrees with this tradition also in taking the simple feeling as the ultimate datum of experience. But, even here, and wherever there is experience, there is a distinction to be drawn--not the traditional distinction between subject and object, but that between consciousness and its object. There are always two aspects in any bit of experience--that of the object itself or the objective aspect, and that of the awareness of it or the subjective aspect; and these two are connected by the relation of knowledge. The sciences are concerned with the objective aspect only; philosophy has to deal with the subjective aspect, or the conscious process which is fundamental and common to all the various objects. Beyond this conscious reference there is nothing. The mirage of absolute existence, wholly apart from knowledge, is a common-sense prejudice. Consciousness is commensurate with being; all existence has a subjective aspect. But this doctrine, he holds, is misinterpreted when mind and body are supposed to interact or when mental and bodily facts are regarded as parallel aspects of the same substance. In psychology Hodgson may be called a materialist, unfit as that name would be to describe his final philosophical attitude. Ideas do not determine one another, nor does desire cause volition; the only real condition known to us is matter. And yet matter itself is a composite existence; it can be analyzed into empirical precepts; and therefore it is itself conditioned by something which is not material: the very term existence implies relativity to some sort of consciousness or other. This is the conclusion of the general analysis of experience. Of the unseen world which lies beyond the material part of the world we cannot, he contends, have any speculative knowledge. But the ethical judgment and our own moral nature bring us into practical relation with that unseen world and thus permit a positive, although not a speculative, knowledge of it. In this way, in the final issue of his philosophy as well as in its fundamental positions, Hodgson regards himself as correcting and completing the work of Kant.

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Thomas Henry Huxley (1825—1895)

Thomas Henry Huxley, the distinguished zoologist and advocate of Darwinism, made several incursions into philosophy. From his youth he had studied its problems unsystematically; he had a way of going straight to the point in any discussion; and, judged by a literary standard, he was a great master of expository and argumentative prose. Apart from his special work in science, he had an important influence upon English thought through his numerous addresses and essays on the topics of science, philosophy, religion, and politics. Among the most important of his papers relevant here are those entitled 'The Physical Basis of Life' (1868), and 'On the Hypothesis that Animals are Automata' (1874), along with a monograph on Hume (1879) and the Romanes lecture Ethics and Evolution (1893). Huxley is credited with the invention of the term 'agnosticism' to describe his philosophical position: it expresses his attitude towards certain traditional questions without giving any clear delimitation of the frontiers of the knowable. He regards consciousness as a collateral effect of certain physical causes, and only an effect--never also a cause. But, on the other hand, he holds that matter is only a symbol, and that all physical phenomena can be analyzed into states of consciousness. This leaves mental facts in the peculiar position of being collateral effects of something that, after all, is only a symbol for a mental fact; and the contradiction is left without remark.

His contributions to ethics are still more remarkable. In a paper entitled 'Science and Morals' (1888), he concluded that the safety of morality lay "in a real and living belief in that fixed order of nature which sends social disorganization on the track of immorality." His Romanes lecture reveals a different tone. In it the moral order is contrasted with the cosmic order; evolution shows constant struggle; instead of looking to it for moral guidance, he "repudiates the gladiatorial theory of existence." He saw that the facts of historical process did not constitute validity for moral conduct; and his plain language compelled other to see the same truth. But he exaggerated the opposition between them and did not leave room for the influence of moral ideas as a factor in the historical process.

Another man of science, William Kingdon Clifford, professor of mathematics in London, dealt in occasional essays with some central points in the theory of knowledge, ethics, and religion. In these essays he aimed at an interpretation of life in the light of the new science. There was insight as well as courage in all he wrote, and it was conveyed in a brilliant style. But his work was cut short by his early death in 1879, and his contributions to philosophy remain suggestions only.

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Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi (1743—1819)

JacobiGerman philosopher; born at Dusseldorf January. 25,1743; died at Munich March. 10, 1819. He studied at Frankfort and Geneva, and in 1764 became the head of his father's business in Dusseldorf. After his appointment to the council for the duchies of Julich and Berg in 1772 he devoted himself entirely to literature and philosophy. His house at Pempelfort, near Dusseldorf, became the meeting-place of distinguished literary men. Among his more intimate friends were Wieland, Hamann, Herder, Lessing, and Goethe. On account of the political agitation of the time he went to Holstein in 1794. During the next ten years he resided chiefly at Wandsbeek, Hamburg, and Eutin. In 1804 he accepted a call to Munich in connection with the proposed Academy of Sciences there. He was president of the academy from its opening in 1807 till 1812. His writings are characterized by poetic fancy and religious sentiment rather than by logical necessity. He held that the understanding can only join and disjoin given facts, without explaining them, and that knowledge deduced in this way is conditioned and relatively unimportant, being always related to a background of existence which forever remains beyond abstract thinking. All demonstrable knowledge, therefore, is relative and conditioned; it does not touch the ultimate nature of things. The faculty by which we grasp ultimate facts is not the understanding, but faith, which Jacobi identified with reason. It was Jacobi who first pointed out the fatal contradiction involved in Kant's application of the category of causality to the Ding an Sich. His doctrine of the relativity of knowledge was later exploited by Sir William Hamilton. Jacobi's principal works are the two philosophical novels, Woldmwr (2 vols., Flensburg, 1779) and Eduard Allwills Briefsamlung (Breslau, 1781); Ueber die Lehre der Spinoza (1785; enlarged ed., 1789); Dazid Hunw fiber den Glauben, oder Ide-alis;nus und Realismus (1787), containing his criticism of Kant; Ueber das Unternehmen des Kritizismus, die Vernunft zu Verstande zu bringen (Hamburg, 1801); and Von den gottlichen Dingen und ihrer Offenbarung (Leipsic, 1811), which was directed against Schelling. During his last years Jacobi was employed in collecting and editing his Werke (6 vols., Leipsic, 1812-24). His Auserlesener Briefwechsel was edited by F. Roth (2 vols., 1825-27).

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Euclides (c. 430—360 B.C.E.)

Euclides was a native of Megara, and founder of the Megarian or Eristic sect. He applied himself early to the study of philosophy, and learned from the writings of Parmenides the art of disputation. Hearing of the fame of Socrates, Euclides moved to Athens and became a devoted student for many years. Because of an enmity between Athenians and Megarians, a decree was passed which forbid any Megarian from entering Athens under the penalty of death. Euclides moved twenty miles out of Athens, and would sneak into the city at night for instruction, dressed as a woman in a long cloak and veil. He frequently became involved in business disputes in civil courts. Socrates, who despised forensic contests, expressed dissatisfaction with Euclides for his fondness for controversy. It is likely that this provoked a separation between Euclides and Socrates, for after this Euclides was the head of a school in Megara which taught the art of disputation. Debates were conducted with so much vehemence among his pupils, that Timon said of Euclides that he carried the madness of contention from Athens of Megara (Diog. Laert, 6:22). Nevertheless, his restraint is attested to in a story about a quarrel he had with his brother. His brother charged, "Let me perish if do not have revenge on you." To this Euclides replied, "And let me perish if I don not subdue your resentment by forbearance, and make you love me as much as ever." In disputes Euclides was averse to the analogical method of reasoning, and judged that legitimate argumentation consists in deducing fair conclusions from acknowledge premises.

His position was a combination of Socraticism and Eleaticism. Virtue is knowledge, but knowledge of what? It is here that the Eleatic influence became visible. With Parmenides, the Megarics believed in the one Absolute being. All multiplicity, all motion, are illusory. The world of sense has in it no true reality. Only Being is. If virtue is knowledge, therefore, it can only be the knowledge of this Being. If the essential concept of Socrates was the Good, and the essential concept of Parmenides Being, Euclides now combined the two. Thus, according to Cicero, he defined the "supreme good" as that which is always the same. The Good is identified with Being. Being, the One, God, Intelligence, providence, the Good, divinity, are merely different names for the same thing. Becoming, the many, evil, are the names of its opposite, not-being. Multiplicity is thus identified with evil, and both are declared illusory. Evil has no real existence. The good alone truly is. The various virtues, as benevolence, temperance, prudence, are merely different names for the one virtue, knowledge of being. It is said that when Euclides was asked his opinion concerning the gods, he replied, "I know nothing more of them than this, that they hate inquisitive persons."

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Meister Eckhart (1260—1328)

Meister Eckhart was a thirteenth-fourteenth century philosopher, theologian, and mystic who lived and worked in the Dominican Order. It seems he enjoyed a relatively successful academic life and was considered to be an able orator and preacher. Enough of his work has been recovered for scholars to be to able to discern and explicate certain of his themes and concerns; these include the nature of God, The Trinity, the relationship of the human soul to God, and the processes inherent in these and other Christian concerns. Views on sin and redemption, Christ, and ethics are also expounded.  The existing works are in the form of sermons, and fragments of a more substantial three-part work called the Opus tripartitum. Eckhart's views may have teetered toward heresy at times. There is no doubt this caused him a little trouble, though all the details are not clear. Overall he seems to have inspired both admiration and suspicion in various factions. Though not a systematic philosopher, Eckhart's insights and contributions remain a source of curiosity to modern readers both inside and outside of the academy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Works
  3. View of God
  4. Trinitarian Process
  5. God in Creation
  6. Relation of the Soul to God
  7. Sin and Redemption
  8. Place of Christ
  9. Ethics

1. Life

The long controverted question concerning the locality of Eckhart's origin has been settled by Denifle, who states that he was born at Hochheim, a village eight miles north of Gotha. The year of his birth was probably 1260, and he joined the Dominicans at Erfurt. The lighter studies he no doubt followed at Cologne. Later he was prior at Erfurt and provincial of Thuringia. In 1300 he was sent to Paris to lecture and take the academical degrees, and remained there till 1303. In the latter year he returned to Erfurt, and was made provincial for Saxony, a province which reached at that time from the Netherlands to Livonia. Complaints made against him and the provincial of Teutonia at the general chapter held in Paris in 1306 concerning irregularities among the ternaries, must have been trivial, because the general, Aymeric, appointed him in the following year his vicar-general for Bohemia with full power to set the demoralized monasteries there in order. In 1311 Eckhart was appointed by the general chapter of Naples as teacher at Paris. Then follows a long period of which it is known only that he spent part of the time at Strasburg (see Urkundenbuch der Stadt Strassburg, iii. 236). A passage in a chronicle of the year 1320, extant in manuscript (see Preger, i. 352-399), speaks of a prior Eckhart at Frankfort who was suspected of heresy, and some have referred this to Meister Eckhart; but it is highly improbable that a man under suspicion of heresy would have been appointed teacher in one of the most famous schools of the order.

Eckhart next appears as teacher at Cologne, and the archbishop, Hermann von Virneburg, accused him of heresy before the pope. But Nicholas of Strasburg , to whom the pope had given the temporary charge of the Dominican monasteries in Germany, exonerated him. The archbishop, however, pressed his charges against Eckhart and against Nicholas before his own court. The former now denied the competency of the archiepiscopal inquisition and demanded litterce dimissorix (apostoli) for an appeal to the pope (see the document in Preger, i. 471; more accurately in ALKG, ii. 627 and what follows.). On February 13, 1327, he stated in his protest, which was read publicly, that he had always detested everything wrong, and should anything of the kind be found in his writings, he now retracts. Of the further progress of the case there is no information, except that John XXII. issued a bull (In agro dominico), March 27, 1329, in which a series of statements from Eckhart is characterized as heretical; another as suspected of heresy (the bull is given complete in ALKG, ii. 636-640). At the close it is stated that Eckhart recanted before his death everything which he had falsely taught, by subjecting himself and his writing to the decision of the apostolic see. By this is no doubt meant the statement of February 13, 1327; and it may be inferred that Eckhart's death, concerning which no information exists, took place shortly after that event. In 1328 the general chapter of the order at Toulouse decided to proceed against preachers who "endeavor to preach subtle things which not only do (not) advance morals, but easily lead the people into error." Eckhart's disciples were admonished to be more cautious, but nevertheless they cherished the memory of their master.

2. Works

For centuries none of Eckhart's writings were known except a number of sermons, found in the old editions of Tauler's sermons, published by Kachelouen (Leipzig, 1498) and by Adam Petri (Basel, 1521 and 1522). In 1857 Franz Pfeiffer in the second volume of his Deutsche Mystiker (Stuttgart), which is wholly devoted to Eckhart, added considerable manuscript material. Pfeiffer was followed by others, especially Franz Jostes, Meister Eckhart und seine Junger, ungedruckte Texte zur Geschichte der deutschen Mystik (Collectanea Friburgensia, iv., Freiburg, 1895). But some pieces are of doubtful genuineness, and the tradition concerning others is very unsatisfactory. It was a great surprise when in 1880 and 1886 H. Denifle discovered at Erfurt and Cues two manuscripts with Latin works of Eckhart, the existence of which Nicholas of Cusa and Trittenheim had indeed mentioned, but which had since then been considered lost. There can be no doubt as to their genuineness, but thus far only the (comparatively extensive) specimens which Denifle had published (in ALKG, ii.) are known. The extant writings appear to be only parts of a very large work, the Opus tripartitum, which, to judge from the prologue in the first part treated of more than 1,000 propositions, in the second part debated a number of special questions, and in the third part, first expounded Biblical texts (opus sermonum) and afterward explained the books of the Bible in their order with special reference to the important passages. Entirely unknown at present are the contents of the more important manuscript of Cues, especially the exposition of the Gospel of John, which may contain information on many things.

3. View of God

As has already been stated it is impossible to give at present a final decision on Eckhart's world of ideas. Nevertheless an attempt may be made to delineate his fundamental thoughts, based upon the material at hand. The great need of man is that his soul be united with God; for this a knowledge of God and his relation to the world, a knowledge of the soul and the way which it must go, are necessary. Eckhart does not doubt that such knowledge is given in the traditional faith of the Church, but it is not sufficient for one who is longing for salvation. He must attain to it with his own understanding. Eckhart accordingly does not move and live in ecclesiastical tradition after the manner of Bernard of Clairvaux or Hugo of Saint Victor; in his thinking on the highest questions he is independent and in this way he arrives at views which do not harmonize with the teaching of the Church, without, however, as far as can be seen, being conscious of any opposition. The last and highest object of thinking is the Deity, that is, the divine entity as distinguished from the persons, yet Eckhart often uses "God" in the sense of "Deity," where his thought does not call for accurate definitions (but see, on the other hand, 180, 14; 181, 7). The Deity is absolute being without distinction of place or manner (ALKG, ii. 439-440). No predicate derived from finite being is applicable to the Deity; but this is therefore not mere negation or emptiness. Rather is finite being, as such, negation; and the Deity, as the negation of finite being, is the negation of negation, that is, the absolute fulness of being (322, 131 539, 10-27). Dionysius wrongly states: God is not, he is rather a nonentity. When in other passages (82, 26; 182, 31; 500, 27) Eckhart himself designates God as non-existent, he only means that he has none of the characteristics of finite existence. The same apparent contradiction is found, where Eckhart on the one hand calls God absolute being, and on the other denies that he is a being (319, 4; 659, 1); but he reconciles the two views (268-269). The same is the case with occasional seemingly paradoxical expressions such as, for example, that God is not good. (269, 18; 318, 35-319, 3). The essential elements of finite things are present in God, but in an exalted degree and in a manner that can not be comprehended by man (322, 20; 540, 2-7).

4. Trinitarian Process

The absolute, unqualified being of the Deity Eckhart also calls unnatured nature. This unnatured nature, however, manifests itself in the natured nature, the three persons. The Trinity is the self-revelation of the Deity (540, 31; 390,12-22). In it God comprises himself. Accordingly, Eckhart attributes to the Father a sort of genesis; only the Deity is absolutely without any progression and reposes everlastingly in itself. The Father was made through himself (534, 17). This self-revelation of God Eckhart designates as a cognition, a speaking, or a demeanor. The Father perceives the whole fulness of the Deity (6,S); or, what is the same, he speaks a single word, which comprises everything (70, 25). He procreates the Son (284, 12); for the Father is father only through the Son. The Son, however, is in everything like the Father, only that he procreates not,(337, 3). The essence of the Father is also that of the Son, and the essence in both is no other than that of the Deity. From the pleasure and love which both have for each other springs the Holy Ghost (497, 26). Eckhart leaves no doubt that the entire trinitarian process must not be conceived of as a temporal one, but as a process extending throughout eternity (254, 10). Preger thought that Eckhart's distinction between Deity and God should be interpreted as a distinction between potentiality and actuality. To this interpretation Denifle (ALKG, ii. 453 and what follows) has strongly objected and cited Eckhart's Latin writings, in which he, with Thomas Aquinas and others, designates God as actus purus, thus excluding all potentiality. Denifle is right, in that Eckhart does not consciously and deliberately make any such distinction; but it can not be denied that his conception leads to it. Especially significant is Eckhart's explanation in 175, 7 and what follows, where he tries to illustrate the relation between the fatherhood as it is determined in the Deity and the paternity of the person of the Father by the relation between the maternity peculiar to the Virgin as such, and the maternity which she acquires by bearing. But this is exactly the relation of potentiality and actuality (see also the peculiar passage 193, 33). It must be admitted that Eckhart here expresses two views which can not be harmonized with one another, though the second is not fully developed. Eckhart had a wealth of ingenious ideas, but he was unable to systematize them.

5. God in Creation

The self-manifestation of God in the Trinity is followed by his manifestation in his creatures. Everything in them that is truly real is God's eternal being; but God's being does not manifest itself thus in its entire fulness (101, 34; 173, 26; 503, 26). In this antithesis may be expressed the relation of Eckhart's philosophy to pantheism, both as regards similarities and differences. According to Eckhart God's creatures have not, as Thomas Aquinas held, merely ideal preexistence in God, that is, their conceptual essence (essential quidditas) coming from the divine intelligence, but their existence (esse) being foreign to the divine being. Rather is the true being of the creatures immanent in the divine being. On the other hand, every peculiarity distinguishing, creatures from each other is something negative; and in this sense it is said that the creatures are a mere nothing. Should God withdraw from his creatures his being, they would disappear as the shadow on the wall disappears when the wall is removed (31, 2). This perishable being is the creature confined within the limits of space and time (87, 49). On the other hand, every creature, considered according to its true entity, is eternal. It is obvious that this necessarily involves a modification of the idea of creation. Even Augustine and the Schoolmen felt this difficulty. While they did not, like Eckhart connect the existence of the world with the being of God they did consider it unallowable to attribute to God any temporary activity. Albert the Great tried to avoid the difficulty with the sentence, "God created all things from eternity, but things were not created from eternity"; but this is more easily said than conceived. According to the bull of 1329 (p. 2), Eckhart asserted that "it may be conceded that the world was from eternity." It is impossible here to investigate this view further; but reference must be made to the close relation into which Eckhart brings the process of the Trinity and the genesis, or progress, of the world, both of the real and the ideal world (76, 52; 254, 16; 284, 12; and Commentary in Genesis; ALKG, ii. 553, 13-17).

6. Relation of the Soul to God

The unqualified Deity, the Trinity (birth of the Son or of the Eternal Lord), and the creation of the world are to him three immediate moments, which follow each other in conceptual, not temporal sequence. All creatures have part in the divine essence; but this is true of the soul in a higher degree. In the irrational creature there is something of God; but in the soul God is divine (230, 26; 2,31, 4). Though God speaks his word in all creatures, only rational creatures can preserve it (479, 19). In other words, in the soul, where he has his resting-place, God is subjective, while in the rest of creation he is merely objective. The soul is an image of God, in so far as its chief powers, memory, reason, and will, answer to the divine persons (319, 1). This accords with the view of Augustine. Just as there is the absolute Deity, which is superior to the persons of the Godhead, so in the soul there is something that is superior to its own powers. This is the innermost background of the soul, which Eckhart frequently calls a "spark," or "little spark." In its real nature this basis of the soul is one with the Deity (66, 2). When Eckhart sometimes speaks of it as uncreated (286, 16; 311, 6), and then again as created, this does not involve a contradiction. While, on the one hand, it rests eternally in the Deity, on the other, it entered into the temporal existence of the soul, that is, was made or created through grace. But it is not in this original unity with God that the soul finds its perfection and bliss. As it has a subjective being, it must turn to God, in order that the essential principle implanted in it may be truly realized. It is not enough that it was made by God; God must come and be in it. But this has taken place without hindrance only in the human soul of Christ (67, 12). For all other souls sin is an obstacle.

7. Sin and Redemption

But wherein does sin consist? Not in the finiteness, which is never removed from the soul (3S7, 3; 500, 1 1), but in the direction of the will toward the finite and its pleasure therein (476, 19; 674, 17). The possibility of sin, however, is based in finiteness, taken together with the free will of the creature. If it is the destiny of the soul to be the resting-place of God, then the direction of the will toward the finite makes this impossible; and it is this that constitutes sin. Redemption, therefore, can take place only when the creature makes room in his soul for the work of God; and the condition for that is the turning away from the finite. For God is ever ready to work in the soul, provided he is not hindered and the soul is susceptible to his influence (27, 25; 283, 23; 33, 29; 479, 31). The inner separation from everything casual, sensual, earthly and the yielding to the work of God in the heart; that is the seclusion or tranquillity of which Eckhart speaks again and again. For him this is the basis of all piety. But what is it that God accomplishes in the soul? This can be stated in a word: the birth of the son. As the soul is an image of the Deity, if it is to fulfil its destiny, then that process by which the deity develops into the three persons must take place in it. The father procreates in the soul the son (44, 28; 175, 15-20; 479, 10; 13, 12). This takes place during the life of the soul in time; and, too, not merely at a particular moment, but rather continuously and repeatedly. This is not merely a copy or analogon of that inner divine process, but is in truth that very process itself, by which it becomes, through grace, what the Son of God is by nature (433, 32; 382, 7; 377, 17). From this view of Eckhart's follow a number of the most striking statements in which the soul is made to share in the attributes and works of God, including the creation (119, 28-40; 267, 4; 283, 37-284, 7). However, according to Eckhart, a complete fusion of the soul with the Deity never takes place (387, 3). He also opposes the doctrine of Apocatastasis (65, 20; 402, 34; 470, 22).

8. Place of Christ

According to Eckhart sin is not the real cause of the incarnation (591, 34). God wished rather to receive the nature of things through grace in time just as he had them by nature in eternity in himself (574, 34). Just as a man occupies a central position in the world, since he leads all creatures back to God, so Christ stands in the center of humanity (180, 7; 390, 37.) The same thought is found in Maximus the Confessor and Erigena, but whence did Eckhart get it? Even at the creation of the first man Christ was already the end in view (250, 23); and now after the fact of sin, Christ stands likewise in the center of redemption. After the fall all creatures worked together to produce a man who should restore the harmony (497, 11). This took place when Mary resigned herself so completely to the divine word that the eternal word could assume human nature in her. However, this temporal birth of the son is again included in his eternal birth as a moment of the same (391, 20). And now God is to be born in us. In his human life Jesus becomes a pattern for man; and in all that he did and experienced, above all in his passion and death there is an overwhelming power that draws man to God (218-219) and brings about in us that which first took place in Christ, who alone is the way to the father (241, 17).

9. Ethics

Whatever one may think of Eckhart's philosophical and dogmatic speculations, his ethical view, at any rate, is of rare purity and sublimity. The inner position of man, the disposition of the heart, is for him the main thing (56, 39; 297, 11; 444, S; 560, 43) and with him this is not a result of reflection. One feels that it comes from the core of his personality; and no doubt this was the principal reason for the deep impression his sermons made. He speaks little of church ceremonies. For him outward penances have only a limited value. That man inwardly turn to God and be led by him; that is the main purpose of Eckhart's exhortations. Let no one think because this or that great saint has done and suffered many things, that he should imitate him. God gives to each his task, and leaves every one on his way (560 and what follows, 177, 26-35). No one can express the fact more definitely than does Eckhart, that it is not works that justify man, but that man must first be righteous in order to do righteous works. Nor does he recommend that one flee from the world, but flee from oneself, from selfishness, and self-will. Otherwise one finds as little peace in the cell as outside of it. Though he sees in suffering the most effective and most valuable means of inner purification, still he does not mean that one should seek sufferings of his own choosing, but only bear patiently whatever God imposes. He recognizes that it is natural for one to be affected either pleasantly or unpleasantly by the various sense-impressions; but in the innermost depths of the soul one must hold fast to God and allow himself to be moved by nothing (52, 1; 427, 22). It need hardly be added that he regards highly works of charity. Even supreme rapture should not prevent one from rendering a service to the poor. It is noteworthy that, in the ninth sermon, he puts Martha higher than Mary, though by a strange misinterpretation of the text. While Mary enjoyed only the sweetness of the Lord, being yet a learner, Martha had passed this stage. She stood firm in the substance, and no work hindered her, but every work helped her to blessedness. Future investigations will presumably make possible a more accurate estimate of the importance of Eckhart; but it is hardly possible that they will overthrow the verdict of Suso and Tauler concerning him.

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Henry St. John Bolingbroke (1678—1751)


Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Philosophy

1. Life

Henry St. John Bolingbroke was born in Battersea England in 1678. He was educated at Eton and Oxford, after which he traveled about two years on the continent. In 1700, shortly after his return, he married the daughter of Sir Henry Winchcomb, from whom he soon separated. Up to this period, he was chiefly known for his extreme dissipation but, after entering parliament in 1701, he devoted himself to politics, joined the Tory party, and soon made himself prominent as an orator. In 1704 he was made secretary of war and retained this office until 1708 when the Whigs came into power, after which he retired from politics and applied himself to study. After resignation, Bolingbroke retained great influence as the queen's favorite counselor. On the fall of the Whig party in 1710, he was made secretary of state for foreign affairs. In 1712, he was called to the house of lords by the title of Viscount Bolingbroke and in 1713, against the wishes of nearly the entire nation, concluded the peace of Utrecht. Having previously quarreled with his old friend Harley, now the Earl of Oxford and his most powerful rival, he contrived his dismissal in July 1714. Bolingbroke immediately proceeded to form a strong Jacobite ministry in accordance with the well-known inclinations of his royal mistress, whose death a few days after threw into disorder his dangerous and unprincipled schemes. The accession of George I was a deathblow to Bolingbroke's political prospects, on August 28 he was deposed from office, in March 1715 he fled to France and, in August 1715 he was attainted. For some time he held the office of secretary of state to the Pretender, but his restless and ambitious spirit yearned for the 'large excitement' of English politics. Bolingbroke's efforts to obtain a pardon were not successful and he retired to a small estate which he had purchased near Orleans. In 1718 his first wife died and, in 1720, he married the rich widow of the Marquis de Vilette.

A prudent use of this lady's wealth enabled him to return to England in September 1724. His property was restored to him, but he was never permitted to take his seat in parliament. He therefore removed himself to his villa at Dawley, near Uxbridge, where he occasionally enjoyed the society of Swift, Pope, and others of his old friends with whom he had corresponded in his exile. It was at Dawley where Bolingbroke diversified his moral and metaphysical studies by his attacks on the ministry in his periodical the Craftsman, in which the letters forming his Dissertation on Parties first appeared. In 1735, finding his political hopes clouded forever, he went back to France and continued to live there until 1742. During his second residence abroad, he wrote his Letters on the Study of History in which he violently attacked the Christian religion. He died on October 1, 1751, after a long illness. His talents were brilliant and versatile; his style of writing was polished and eloquent; but his fatal lack of sincerity and honest purpose, and the low and unscrupulous ambition which made him scramble for power with a selfish indifference to national security, hindered him from looking wisely and deeply into any question. His philosophical theories are not profound, nor his conclusions solid, while his criticism of passing history is worthless.

2. Philosophy

Bolingbroke's philosophical writings were mostly unprinted until after his death, when David Mallet published a five-volume collection of Bolingbroke's works. The philosophical portions of this collection display his dependence on Locke, who Bolingbroke acknowledged as his "master." Using Locke's ideas and his own, Bolingbroke attempts to explain how one attains knowledge and what its limits are, as well as asserting his own beliefs about God and religion. In doing so, he makes virulent attacks on previous philosophers such as Plato, Malebranche, and Berkley.

Following Locke, Bolingbroke distinguishes between ideas of sensation and ideas of reflection. Borrowing further from Locke, he calls these "simple ideas" and says they are the materials out of which complex ideas are made. He goes on to say that although one may not understand the process by which objects produce sensory perceptions, one can know they do so. Likewise, one may not know how the will causes action, such as the movement of an arm, but this does not hinder one from knowing it is the will which causes it. He presents these beliefs as clear and obvious and in no need of being questioned. Bolingbroke gives less power, than does Locke, to the mind concerning its ability to combine ideas within itself, putting this power in nature instead. Bolingbroke also maintains that nature (the observable world) serves as a reliable guide, and error comes when one uses one's faculties out of accordance with nature.

Bolingbroke is known for being a Deist. He asserts there is a God, and proving this by reason is possible. However, this God is not at all like humans, and Bolingbroke speaks of anthropomorphism with contempt. Instead, he says God is so dissimilar to human beings, the distance between them is unimaginable and no comparison between the two is possible. Bolingbroke uses the cosmological argument to demonstrate there is a God, but goes on to assert that this God is omnipotent and omniscient and always does what is best. (Bolingbroke even claims this is the best of all possible worlds.) In order to defend his view of God's transcendence, Bolingbroke says that while one can be certain God knows everything, one can never comprehend the way in which He knows things, and goes as far as to say God's manner of knowing cannot be understood by human beings. God's morality is equally beyond human understanding. Our moral values are based solely on our existence as social beings who cannot live lives of isolation or follow a path of pure selfishness. These morals can be discovered by reason. While they arise out of the nature of things created by God, they are in no way indicative of a divine sense of morality. God created the world, and the nature of the world determines morality. However, this nature does not reflect the character or nature of God.

Bolingbroke states Christianity was originally a "complete" and "very plain system of religion," was actually no more than the "natural religion," and Jesus did not teach anything more than could be discovered by reason. Bolingbroke expresses regret that Christian teachings did not remain at their initial, simple level, and wishes they had never been corrupted by such systems as Platonism, which he regards as the product of mere imagination. His understanding of religion furthermore denies the validity of prayer by insisting one could not come into contact with one's deity, denigrates the importance of the crucifixion in Christianity, and suggests one cannot know whether or not there is a soul which survives the death of the body.

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Rudolf Carnap (1891—1970)

carnap02Rudolf Carnap, a German-born philosopher and naturalized U.S. citizen, was a leading exponent of logical positivism and was one of the major philosophers of the twentieth century. He made significant contributions to philosophy of science, philosophy of language, the theory of probability, inductive logic and modal logic. He rejected metaphysics as meaningless because metaphysical statements cannot be proved or disproved by experience. He asserted that many philosophical problems are indeed pseudo-problems, the outcome of a misuse of language. Some of them can be resolved when we recognize that they are not expressing matters of fact, but rather concern the choice between different linguistic frameworks. Thus the logical analysis of language becomes the principal instrument in resolving philosophical problems. Since ordinary language is ambiguous, Carnap asserted the necessity of studying philosophical issues in artificial languages, which are governed by the rules of logic and mathematics. In such languages, he dealt with the problems of the meaning of a statement, the different interpretations of probability, the nature of explanation, and the distinctions between analytic and synthetic, a priori and a posteriori, and necessary and contingent statements.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Structure of Scientific Theories
  3. Analytic and Synthetic
  4. Meaning and Verifiability
  5. Probability and Inductive Logic
  6. Modal Logic and the Philosophy of Language
  7. Philosophy of Physics
  8. Carnap's Heritage
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Carnap's Works
    2. Other Sources

1. Life

Rudolf Carnap was born on May 18, 1891, in Ronsdorf, Germany. In 1898, after his father's death, his family moved to Barmen, where Carnap studied at the Gymnasium. From 1910 to1914 he studied philosophy, physics and mathematics at the universities of Jena and Freiburg. He studied Kant under Bruno Bauch and later recalled how a whole year was devoted to the discussion of The Critique of Pure Reason. Carnap became especially interested in Kant’s theory of space. Carnap took three courses from Gottlob Frege in 1910, 1913 and 1914. Frege was professor of mathematics at Jena. During those courses, Frege expounded his system of logic and its applications in mathematics. However, Carnap’s principal interest at that time was in physics, and by 1913 he was planning to write his dissertation on thermionic emission. His studies were interrupted by World War I and Carnap served at the front until 1917. He then moved to Berlin and studied the theory of relativity. At that time, Albert Einstein was professor of physics at the University of Berlin.

After the war, Carnap developed a new dissertation, this time on an axiomatic system for the physical theory of space and time. He submitted a draft to physicist Max Wien, director of the Institute of Physics at the University of Jena, and to Bruno Bauch. Both found the work interesting, but Wien told Carnap the dissertation was pertinent to philosophy, not to physics, while Bauch said it was relevant to physics. Carnap then chose to write a dissertation under the direction of Bauch on the theory of space from a philosophical point of view. Entitled Der Raum (Space), the work was clearly influenced by Kantian philosophy. Submitted in 1921, it was published the following year in a supplemental issue of Kant-Studien.

Carnap's involvement with the Vienna Circle developed over the next few years. He met Hans Reichenbach at a conference on philosophy held at Erlangen in 1923. Reichenbach introduced him to Moritz Schlick, then professor of the theory of inductive science at Vienna. Carnap visited Schlick - and the Vienna Circle - in 1925 and the following year moved to Vienna to become assistant professor at the University of Vienna. He became a leading member of the Vienna Circle and, in 1929, with Hans Hahn and Otto Neurath, he wrote the manifesto of the Circle.

In 1928, Carnap published The Logical Structure of the World, in which he developed a formal version of empiricism arguing that all scientific terms are definable by means of a phenomenalistic language. The great merit of the book was the rigor with which Carnap developed his theory. In the same year he published Pseudoproblems in Philosophy asserting the meaninglessness of many philosophical problems. He was closely involved in the First Conference on Epistemology, held in Prague in 1929 and organized by the Vienna Circle and the Berlin Circle (the latter founded by Reichenbach in 1928). The following year, he and Reichenbach founded the journal Erkenntnis. At the same time, Carnap met Alfred Tarski, who was developing his semantical theory of truth. Carnap was also interested in mathematical logic and wrote a manual of logic, entitled Abriss der Logistik (1929).

In 1931, Carnap moved to Prague to become professor of natural philosophy at the German University. It was there that he made his important contribution to logic with The Logical Syntax of Language (1934). His stay in Prague, however, was cut short by the Nazi rise to power. In 1935, with the aid of the American philosophers Charles Morris and Willard Van Orman Quine, whom he had met in Prague the previous year, Carnap moved to the United States. He became an American citizen in 1941.

From 1936 to1952, Carnap was a professor at the University of Chicago (with the year 1940-41 spent as a visiting professor at Harvard University). He then spent two years at the Institute for Advanced Study at Princeton before taking an appointment at the University of California at Los Angeles.

In the 1940s, stimulated by Tarskian model theory, Carnap became interested in semantics. He wrote several books on semantics: Introduction to Semantics (1942), Formalization of Logic (1943), and Meaning and Necessity: A Study in Semantics and Modal Logic (1947). In Meaning and Necessity, Carnap used semantics to explain modalities. Subsequently he began to work on the structure of scientific theories. His main concerns were (i) to give an account of the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements and (ii) to give a suitable formulation of the verifiability principle; that is, to find a criterion of significance appropriate to scientific language. Other important works were "Meaning Postulates" (1952) and "Observation Language and Theoretical Language" (1958). The latter sets out Carnap's definitive view on the analytic-synthetic distinction. "The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts" (1958) is an attempt to give a tentative definition of a criterion of significance for scientific language. Carnap was also interested in formal logic (Introduction to Symbolic Logic, 1954) and in inductive logic (Logical Foundations of Probability, 1950; The Continuum of Inductive Methods, 1952). The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, ed. by Paul Arthur Schilpp, was published in 1963 and includes an intellectual autobiography. Philosophical Foundations of Physics, ed. by Martin Gardner, was published in 1966. Carnap was working on the theory of inductive logic when he died on September 14, 1970, at Santa Monica, California.

2. The Structure of Scientific Theories

In Carnap's opinion, a scientific theory is an interpreted axiomatic formal system. It consists of:

  • a formal language, including logical and non-logical terms;
  • a set of logical-mathematical axioms and rules of inference;
  • a set of non-logical axioms, expressing the empirical portion of the theory;
  • a set of meaning postulates stating the meaning of non-logical terms, which formalize the analytic truths of the theory;
  • a set of rules of correspondence, which give an empirical interpretation of the theory.

The sets of meaning postulates and rules of correspondence may be included in the set of non-logical axioms. Indeed, meaning postulates and rules of correspondence are not usually explicitly distinguished from non-logical axioms; only one set of axioms is formulated. One of the main purposes of the philosophy of science is to show the difference between the various kinds of statements.

The Language of Scientific Theories The language of a scientific theory consists of:

  1. a set of symbols and
  2. rules to ensure that a sequence of symbols is a well-formed formula, that is, correct with respect to syntax.

Among the symbols of the language are logical and non-logical terms. The set of logical terms include logical symbols, e.g., connectives and quantifiers, and mathematical symbols, e.g., numbers, derivatives, and integrals. Non-logical terms are divided into observational and theoretical. They are symbols denoting physical entities, properties or relations such as 'blue', 'cold', ' warmer than', 'proton', 'electromagnetic field'. Formulas are divided into: (i) logical statements, which do not contain non-logical terms; (ii) observational statements, which contain observational terms but no theoretical terms; (iii) purely theoretical statements, which contain theoretical terms but no observational terms and (iv) rules of correspondence, which contain both observational and theoretical terms.

Classification of statements in a scientific language
type of statement
observational terms
theoretical terms
logical statements No No
observational statements Yes No
purely theoretical statements No Yes
rules of correspondence Yes Yes

Observational language contains only logical and observational statements; theoretical language contains logical and theoretical statements and rules of correspondence.

The distinction between observational and theoretical terms is a central tenet of logical positivism and at the core of Carnap's view on scientific theories. In his book Philosophical Foundations of Physics (1966), Carnap bases the distinction between observational and theoretical terms on the distinction between two kinds of scientific laws, namely empirical laws and theoretical laws.

An empirical law deals with objects or properties that can be observed or measured by means of simple procedures. This kind of law can be directly confirmed by empirical observations. It can explain and forecast facts and be thought of as an inductive generalization of such factual observations. Typically, an empirical law which deals with measurable physical quantities, can be established by means of measuring such quantities in suitable cases and then interpolating a simple curve between the measured values. For example, a physicist could measure the volume V, the temperature T and the pressure P of a gas in diverse experiments, and he could find the law PV=RT, for a suitable constant R.

A theoretical law, on the other hand, is concerned with objects or properties we cannot observe or measure but only infer from direct observations. A theoretical law cannot be justified by means of direct observation. It is not an inductive generalization but a hypothesis reaching beyond experience. While an empirical law can explain and forecast facts, a theoretical law can explain and forecast empirical laws. The method of justifying a theoretical law is indirect: a scientist does not test the law itself but, rather, the empirical laws that are among its consequences.

The distinction between empirical and theoretical laws entails the distinction between observational and theoretical properties, and hence between observational and theoretical terms. The distinction in many situations is clear, for example: the laws that deal with the pressure, volume and temperature of a gas are empirical laws and the corresponding terms are observational; while the laws of quantum mechanics are theoretical. Carnap admits, however, that the distinction is not always clear and the line of demarcation often arbitrary. In some ways the distinction between observational and theoretical terms is similar to that between macro-events, which are characterized by physical quantities that remain constant over a large portion of space and time, and micro-events, where physical quantities change rapidly in space or time.

3. Analytic and Synthetic

To the logical empiricist, all statements can be divided into two classes: analytic a priori and synthetic a posteriori. There can be no synthetic a priori statements. A substantial aspect of Carnap's work was his attempt to give precise definition to the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements.

In The Logical Syntax of Language (1934), Carnap studied a formal language that could express classical mathematics and scientific theories, for example, classical physics. Carnap would have known Kurt Gödel’s 1931 article on the incompleteness of mathematics. He was, therefore, aware of the substantial difference between the two concepts of proof and consequence: some statements, despite being a logical consequence of the axioms of mathematics, are not provable by means of these axioms. He would not, however, have been able to take account of Alfred Tarski’s essay on semantics, first published in Polish in 1933. Tarski’s essay led to the notion of logical consequence being regarded as a semantic concept and defined by means of model theory. These circumstances explain how Carnap, in The Logical Syntax of Language, gave a purely syntactic formulation of the concept of logical consequence. However, he did define a new rule of inference, now called the omega-rule, but formerly called the Carnap rule:

From the infinite series of premises A(1), A(2), ... , A(n), A(n+1) ,..., we can infer the conclusion (x)A(x)

Carnap defines the notion of logical consequence in the following way: a statement A is a logical consequence of a set S of statements if and only if there is a proof of A based on the set S; it is admissible to use the omega-rule in the proof of A. In the definition of the notion of provable, however, a statement A is provable by means of a set S of statements if and only if there is a proof of A based on the set S, but the omega-rule is not admissible in the proof of A. (A formal system which admits the use of the omega-rule is complete, so Gödel's incompleteness theorem does not apply to such formal systems.

Carnap then proceeded to define some kinds of statements: (i) a statement is L-true if and only if it is a logical consequence of the empty set of statements; (ii) a statement is L-false if and only if all statements are a logical consequence of it; (iii) a statement is analytic if and only if it is L-true or L-false; (iv) a statement is synthetic if and only if is not analytic. Carnap thus defines analytic statements as logically determined statements: their truth depends on logical rules of inference and is independent of experience. Thus, analytic statements are a priori while synthetic statements are a posteriori, because they are not logically determined.

Carnap maintained his definitions of statements in his article “Testability and Meaning” (1936) and his book Meaning and Necessity (1947). In “Testability and Meaning,” he introduced semantic concepts: a statement is analytic if and only if it is logically true; it is self-contradictory if and only if it is logically false. In any other case, the statement is synthetic. In Meaning and Necessity. Carnap first defines the notion of L-true (a statement is L-true if its truth depends on semantic rules) and then defines the notion of L-false (a statements if L-false if its negation is L-true). A statement is L-determined if it is L-true or L-false; analytic statements are L-determined, while synthetic statements are not L-determined. This is very similar to the definitions Carnap gave in The Logical Syntax of Language but with the change from syntactic to semantic concepts.

In 1951, Quine published the article "Two Dogmas of Empiricism," in which he disputed the distinction made between analytic and synthetic statements. In response, Carnap partially changed his point of view on this problem. His first response to Quine came in "Meaning postulates" (1952) where Carnap suggested that analytic statements are those which can be derived from a set of appropriate sentences that he called meaning postulates. Such sentences define the meaning of non logical terms and thus the set of analytic statements is not equal to the set of logically true statements. Later, in "Observation language and theoretical language" (1958), he expressed a general method for determining a set of meaning postulates for the language of a scientific theory. He further expounded on this method in his reply to Carl Gustav Hempel in The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap (1963), and in Philosophical Foundations of Physics (1966). Suppose the number of non-logical axioms is finite. Let T be the conjunction of all purely theoretical axioms, and C the conjunction of all correspondence postulates and TC the conjunction of T and C. The theory is equivalent to the single axiom TC. Carnap formulates the following problems: how can we find two statements, say A and R, so that A expresses the analytic portion of the theory (that is, all consequences of A are analytic) while R expresses the empirical portion (that is, all consequences of R are synthetic)? The empirical content of the theory is formulated by means of a Ramsey sentence (a discovery of the English philosopher Frank Ramsey). Carnap’s solution to the problem builds a Ramsey sentence on the following instructions:

  1. Replace every theoretical term in TC with a variable.
  2. Add an appropriate number of existential quantifiers at the beginning of the sentence.

Look at the following example. Let TC(O 1 ,..,O n ,T 1 ,...,T m ) be the conjunction of T and C; in TC there are observational terms O 1 ...O n and theoretical terms T 1 ...T m . The Ramsey sentence (R) is

EX 1 ...EX m TC(O 1 ,...,O n ,X 1 ,...,X m )

Every observational statement which is derivable from TC is also derivable from R and vice versa so that, R expresses exactly the empirical portion of the theory. Carnap proposes the statement R TC as the only meaning postulate; this became known as the Carnap sentence. Note that every empirical statement that can be derived from the Carnap sentence is logically true, and thus the Carnap sentence lacks empirical consequences. So, a statement is analytic if it is derivable from the Carnap sentence; otherwise the statement is synthetic. The requirements of Carnap's method can be summarized as follows : (i) non-logical axioms must be explicitly stated, (ii) the number of non-logical axioms must be finite and (iii) observational terms must be clearly distinguished from theoretical terms.

4. Meaning and Verifiability

Perhaps the most famous tenet of logical empiricism is the verifiability principle, according to which a synthetic statement is meaningful only if it is verifiable. Carnap sought to give a logical formulation of this principle. In The Logical Structure of the World (1928) he asserted that a statement is meaningful only if every non-logical term is explicitly definable by means of a very restricted phenomenalistic language. A few years later, Carnap realized that this thesis was untenable because a phenomenalistic language is insufficient to define physical concepts. Thus he choose an objective language ("thing language") as the basic language, one in which every primitive term is a physical term. All other terms (biological, psychological, cultural) must be defined by means of basic terms. To overcome the problem that an explicit definition is often impossible, Carnap used dispositional concepts, which can be introduced by means of reduction sentences. For example, if A, B, C and D are observational terms and Q is a dispositional concept, then

(x)[Ax → (Bx ↔ Qx)]
(x)[Cx → (Dx ↔ ~Qx)]

are reduction sentences for Q. In “Testability and Meaning” (1936) Carnap revised the new verifiability principle in this way: all terms must be reducible, by means of definitions or reduction sentences, to the observational language. But this proved to be inadequate. K. R. Popper showed not only that some metaphysical terms can be reduced to the observational language and thus fulfill Carnap's requirements, but also that some genuine physical concepts are forbidden. Carnap acknowledged that criticism and in "The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts" (1956) sought to develop a further definition. The main philosophical properties of Carnap's new principle can be outlined under three headings. First, of all, the significance of a term becomes a relative concept: a term is meaningful with respect to a given theory and a given language. The meaning of a concept thus depends on the theory in which that concept is used. This represents a significant modification in empiricism's theory of meaning. Secondly, Carnap explicitly acknowledges that some theoretical terms cannot be reduced to the observational language: they acquire an empirical meaning by means of the links with other reducible theoretical terms. Third, Carnap realizes that the principle of operationalism is too restrictive. Operationalism was formulated by the American physicist Percy Williams Bridgman (1882-1961) in his book The Logic of Modern Physics (1927). According to Bridgman, every physical concept is defined by the operations a physicist uses to apply it. Bridgman asserted that the curvature of space-time, a concept used by Einstein in his general theory of relativity, is meaningless, because it is not definable by means of operations., Bridgman subsequently changed his philosophical point of view, and admitted there is an indirect connection with observations. Perhaps influenced by Popper's criticism, or by the problematic consequences of a strict operationalism, Carnap changed his earlier point of view and freely admitted a very indirect connection between theoretical terms and the observational language.

5. Probability and Inductive Logic

A variety of interpretations of probability have been proposed:

  • Classical interpretation. The probability of an event is the ratio of the favorable outcomes to the possible outcomes. For example: a die is thrown with the result that "the score is five". There are six possible outcomes with only one favorable; thus the probability of "the score is five" is one sixth.
  • Axiomatic interpretation. The probability is whatever fulfils the axioms of the theory of probability. In the early 1930s, the Russian mathematician Andrei Nikolaevich Kolmogorov (1903-1987) formulated the first axiomatic system for probability.
  • Frequency interpretation, now the favored interpretation in empirical science. The probability of an event in a sequence of events is the limit of the relative frequency of that event. Example: throw a die several times and record the scores; the relative frequency of "the score is five" is about one sixth; the limit of the relative frequency is exactly one sixth.
  • Probability as a degree of confirmation. This was an approach supported by Carnap and students of inductive logic. The probability of a statement is the degree of confirmation the empirical evidence gives to the statement. Example: the statement "the score is five" receives a partial confirmation by the evidence; its degree of confirmation is one sixth.
  • Subjective interpretation. The probability is a measure of the degree of belief. A special case is the theory that the probability is a fair betting quotient - this interpretation was supported by Carnap. Example: suppose you bet that the score would be five; you bet a dollar and, if you win, you will receive six dollars: this is a fair bet.
  • Propensity interpretation. This is a proposal of K. R. Popper. The probability of an event is an objective property of the event. For example: the physical properties of a die (the die is homogeneous; it has six sides; on every side there is a different number between one and six; etc.) explain the fact that the limit of the relative frequency of "the score is five" is one sixth.

Carnap devoted himself to giving an account of the probability as a degree of confirmation. The philosophically most significant consequences of his research arise from his assertion that the probability of a statement, with respect to a given body of evidence, is a logical relation between the statement and the evidence. Thus it is necessary to build an inductive logic; that is, a logic which studies the logical relations between statements and evidence. Inductive logic would give us a mathematical method of evaluating the reliability of an hypothesis. In this way inductive logic would answer the problem raised by David Hume's analysis of induction. Of course, we cannot be sure that an hypothesis is true; but we can evaluate its degree of confirmation and we can thus compare alternative theories.

In spite of the abundance of logical and mathematical methods Carnap used in his own research on the inductive logic, he was not able to formulate a theory of the inductive confirmation of scientific laws. In fact, in Carnap's inductive logic, the degree of confirmation of every universal law is always zero.

Carnap tried to employ the physical-mathematical theory of thermodynamic entropy to develop a comprehensive theory of inductive logic, but his plan never progressed beyond an outline stage. His works on entropy were published posthumously.

6. Modal Logic and the Philosophy of Language

The following table, which is an adaptation of a similar table Carnap used in Meaning and Necessity, shows the relations between modal properties such as necessary and impossible and logical properties such as L-true, L-false, analytic, synthetic. The symbol N means "necessarily", so that Np means "necessarily p" or “p is necessary.”

Modal and logical properties of statements
Logical status
p is necessary Np L true, analytic
p is impossible N~p L false, contradictory
p is contingent ~Np & ~N~p factual, synthetic
p is not necessary ~Np Not L true
p is possible ~N~p Not L false
p is not contingent Np v N~p L determined, not synthetic

Carnap identifies the necessity of a statement p with its logical truth: a statement is necessary if and only if it is logically true. Thus modal properties can be defined by means of the usual logical properties of statements. Np, i.e., "necessarily p", is true if and only if p is logically true. He defines the possibility of p as "it is not necessary that not p". That is, "possibly p" is defined as ~N~p. The impossibility of p means that p is logically false. It must be stressed that, in Carnap's opinion, every modal concept is definable by means of the logical properties of statements. Modal concepts are thus explicable from a classical point of view (meaning "using classical logic", e.g., first order logic). Carnap was aware that the symbol N is definable only in the meta-language, not in the object language. Np means "p is logically true", and the last statement belongs to the meta-language; thus N is not explicitly definable in the language of a formal logic, and we cannot eliminate the term N. More precisely, we can define N only by means of another modal symbol we take as a primitive symbol, so that at least one modal symbol is required among the primitive symbols.

Carnap's formulation of modal logic is very important from a historical point of view. Carnap gave the first semantic analysis of a modal logic, using Tarskian model theory to explain the conditions in which "necessarily p" is true. He also solved the problem of the meaning of the statement (x)N[Ax], where Ax is a sentence in which the individual variable x occurs. Carnap showed that (x)N[Ax] is equivalent to N[(x)Ax] or, more precisely, he proved we can assume its equivalence without contradictions.

From a broader philosophical point of view, Carnap believed that modalities did not require a new conceptual framework; a semantic logic of language can explain the modal concepts. The method he used in explaining modalities was a typical example of his philosophical analysis. Another interesting example is the explanation of belief-sentences which Carnap gave in Meaning and Necessity. Carnap asserts that two sentences have the same extension if they are equivalent, i.e., if they are both true or both false. On the other hand, two sentences have the same intension if they are logically equivalent, i.e., their equivalence is due to the semantic rules of the language. Let A be a sentence in which another sentence occurs, say p. A is called "extensional with respect to p" if and only if the truth value of A does not change if we substitute the sentence p with an equivalent sentence q. A is called "intensional with respect to p" if and only if (i) A is not extensional with respect to p and (ii) the truth of A does not change if we substitute the sentence p with a logically equivalent sentence q. The following examples arise from Carnap’s assertions:

  • The sentence A v B is extensional with respect to both A and B; we can substitute A and B with equivalent sentences and the truth value of A v B does not change.
  • Suppose A is true but not L-true; therefore the sentences A v ~A and A are equivalent (both are true) and, of course, they are not L-equivalent. The sentence N(A v ~A) is true and the sentence N(A) is false; thus N(A) is not extensional with respect to A. On the contrary, if C is a sentence L-equivalent to A v ~A, then N(A v ~A) and N(C) are both true: N(A) is intensional with respect to A.

There are sentences which are neither extensional not intensional; for example, belief-sentences. Carnap's example is "John believes that D". Suppose that "John believes that D" is true; let A be a sentence equivalent to D and let B be a sentence L-equivalent to D. It is possible that the sentences "John believes that A" and "John believes that B" are false. In fact, John can believe that a sentence is true, but he can believe that a logically equivalent sentence is false. To explain belief-sentences, Carnap defines the notion of intensional isomorphism. In broad terms, two sentences are intensionally isomorphic if and only if their corresponding elements are L-equivalent. In the belief-sentence "John believes that D" we can substitute D with an intensionally isomorphic sentence C.

7. Philosophy of Physics

The first and the last books Carnap published during his lifetime were concerned with the philosophy of physics: his doctoral dissertation (Der Raum, 1922) and Philosophical Foundations of Physics, ed. by Martin Gardner, 1966. Der Raum deals with the philosophy of space. Carnap recognizes the difference between three kinds of theories of space: formal, physical and intuitive s. Formal space is analytic a priori; it is concerned with the formal properties of the space that is with those properties which are a logical consequence of a definite set of axioms. Physical space is synthetic a posteriori; it is the object of natural science, and we can know its structure only by means of experience. Intuitive space is synthetic a priori, and is known via a priori intuition. According to Carnap, the distinction between three different kinds of space is similar to the distinction between three different aspects of geometry: projective, metric and topological respectively.

Some aspects of Der Raum remain very interesting. First, Carnap accepts a neo-Kantian philosophical point of view. Intuitive space, with its synthetic a priori character, is a concession to Kantian philosophy. Second, Carnap uses the methods of mathematical logic; for example, the characterization of intuitive space is given by means of Hilbert's axioms for topology. Thirdly, the distinction between formal and physical space is similar to the distinction between mathematical and physical geometry. This distinction, first proposed by Hans Reichenbach and later accepted by Carnap, and became the official position of logical empiricism on the philosophy of space.

Carnap also developed a formal system for space-time topology. He asserted (1925) that space relations are based on the causal propagation of a signal, while the causal propagation itself is based on the time order.

Philosophical Foundations of Physics is a clear and approachable survey of topics from the philosophy of physics based on Carnap's university lectures. Some theories expressed there are not those of Carnap alone, but they belong to the common heritage of logical empiricism. The subjects dealt with in the book include:

  • The structure of scientific explanation: deductive and probabilistic explanation.
  • The philosophical and physical significance of non-Euclidean geometry; the theory of space in the general theory of relativity. Carnap argues against Kantian philosophy, especially against the synthetic a priori, and against conventionalism. He gives a clear explanation of the main properties of non-Euclidean geometry.
  • Determinism and quantum physics.
  • The nature of scientific language. Carnap deals with (i) the distinction between observational and theoretical terms, (ii) the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements and (iii) quantitative concepts.

As a sample of the content of Philosophical Foundations of Physics we can briefly look at Carnap's thought on scientific explanation. Carnap accepts the classical theory developed by Carl Gustav Hempel. Carnap gives the following example to explain the general structure of a scientific explanation:

(x)(Px→ Qx)

where the first statement is a scientific law; the second, is a description of the initial conditions; and the third, is the description of the event we want to explain. The last statement is a logical consequence of the first and the second, which are the premises of the explanation. A scientific explanation is thus a logical derivation of an appropriate statement from a set of premises, which state universal laws and initial conditions. According to Carnap, there is another kind of scientific explanation, probabilistic explanation, in which at least one universal law is not a deterministic law, but a probabilistic law. Again Carnap’s example is:

fr(Q,P) = 0.8

where the first sentence means "the relative frequency of Q with respect to P is 0.8". Qa is not a logical consequence of the premises; therefore this kind of explanation determines only a certain degree of confirmation for the event we want to explain.

8. Carnap's Heritage

Carnap's work has stimulated much debate. A substantial scholarly literature, both critical and supportive, has developed from examination of his thought. With respect to the analytic-synthetic distinction, Ryszard Wojcicki and Marian Przelecki - two Polish logicians - formulated a semantic definition of the distinction between analytic and synthetic. They proved that the Carnap sentence is the weakest meaning postulate, i.e., every meaning postulate entails the Carnap sentence. As a result, the set of analytic statements which are a logical consequence of the Carnap sentence is the smallest set of analytic statements. Wojcicki and Przelecki's research is independent of the distinction between observational and theoretical terms, i.e., their suggested definition also works in a purely theoretical language. They also dispense with the requirement for a finite number of non-logical axioms.

The tentative definition of meaningfulness that Carnap proposed in "The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts" has been proved untenable. See, for example, David Kaplan, "Significance and Analyticity" in Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist and Marco Mondadori's introduction to Analiticità, Significanza, Induzione, in which Mondadori suggests a possible correction of Carnap's definition.

With respect to inductive logic, I mention only Jaakko Hintikka's generalization of Carnap's continuum of inductive methods. In Carnap's inductive logic, the probability of every universal law is always zero. Hintikka succeeded in formulating an inductive logic in which universal laws can obtain a positive degree of confirmation.

In Meaning and Necessity, 1947, Carnap was the first logician to use a semantic method to explain modalities. However, he used Tarskian model theory, so that every model of the language is an admissible model. In 1972 the American philosopher Saul Kripke was able to prove that a full semantics of modalities can be attained by means of possible-worlds semantics. According to Kripke, not all possible models are admissible. J. Hintikka's essay "Carnap's heritage in logical semantics" in Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist, shows that Carnap came extremely close to possible-worlds semantics, but was not able to go beyond classical model theory.

The omega-rule, which Carnap proposed in The Logical Syntax of Language, has come into widespread use in metamathematical research over a broad range of subjects.

9. References and Further Reading

The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap (1963) contains the most complete bibliography of Carnap's work.  Listed below are Carnap's most important works, arranged in chronological order.

a. Carnap's Works

  • 1922 Der Raum: Ein Beitrag zur Wissenschaftslehre, dissertation, in Kant-Studien, Ergänzungshefte, n. 56
  • 1925 "Über die Abhängigkeit der Eigenschaften der Raumes von denen der Zeit" in Kant-Studien, 30
  • 1926 Physikalische Begriffsbildung, Karlsruhe : Braun, (Wissen und Wirken ; 39)
  • 1928 Scheinprobleme in der Philosophie, Berlin : Weltkreis-Verlag
  • 1928 Der Logische Aufbau der Welt, Leipzig : Felix Meiner Verlag (English translation The Logical Structure of the World; Pseudoproblems in Philosophy, Berkeley : University of California Press, 1967)
  • 1929 (with Otto Neurath and Hans Hahn) Wissenschaftliche Weltauffassung der Wiener Kreis, Vienna : A. Wolf
  • 1929 Abriss der Logistik, mit besonderer Berücksichtigung der Relationstheorie und ihrer Anwendungen, Vienna : Springer
  • 1932 "Die physikalische Sprache als Universalsprache der Wissenschaft" in Erkenntnis, II (English translation The Unity of Science, London : Kegan Paul, 1934)
  • 1934 Logische Syntax der Sprache (English translation The Logical Syntax of Language, New York : Humanities, 1937)
  • 1935 Philosophy and Logical Syntax, London : Kegan Paul
  • 1936 "Testability and meaning" in Philosophy of Science, III (1936) and IV (1937)
  • 1938 "Logical Foundations of the Unity of Science" in International Encyclopaedia of Unified Science, vol. I n. 1, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1939 "Foundations of Logic and Mathematics" in International Encyclopaedia of Unified Science, vol. I n. 3, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1942 Introduction to Semantics, Cambridge, Mass. : Harvard University Press
  • 1943 Formalization of Logic, Cambridge, Mass. : Harvard University Press
  • 1947 Meaning and Necessity: a Study in Semantics and Modal Logic, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1950 Logical Foundations of Probability, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1952 "Meaning postulates" in Philosophical Studies, III (now in Meaning and Necessity, 1956, 2nd edition)
  • 1952 The Continuum of Inductive Methods, Chicago : University of Chicago Press
  • 1954 Einführung in die Symbolische Logik, Vienna : Springer (English translation Introduction to Symbolic Logic and its Applications, New York : Dover, 1958)
  • 1956 "The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts" in Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. I, ed. by H. Feigl and M. Scriven, Minneapolis : University of Minnesota Press
  • 1958 "Beobacthungssprache und theoretische Sprache" in Dialectica, XII (English translation "Observation Language and Theoretical Language" in Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist, Dordrecht, Holl. : D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1975)
  • 1966 Philosophical Foundations of Physics, ed. by Martin Gardner, New York : Basic Books
  • 1977 Two Essays on Entropy, ed. by Abner Shimony, Berkeley : University of California Press

b. Other Sources

  • 1962 Logic and Language: Studies Dedicated to Professor Rudolf Carnap on the Occasion of his Seventieth Birthday, Dordrect, Holl. : D. Reidel Publishing Company
  • 1963 The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap, ed. by Paul Arthur Schillp, La Salle, Ill. : Open Court Pub. Co.
  • 1970 PSA 1970: Proceedings of the 1970 Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association: In Memory of Rudolf Carnap, Dordrect, Holl. : D. Reidel Publishing Company
  • 1971 Analiticità, Significanza, Induzione, ed. by Alberto Meotti e Marco Mondadori, Bologna, Italy : il Mulino
  • 1975 Rudolf Carnap, Logical Empiricist. Materials and Perspectives, ed. by Jaakko Hintikka, Dordrecht, Holl. : D. Reidel Publishing Company
  • 1986 Joëlle Proust, Questions de Forme: Logique at Proposition Analytique de Kant a Carnap, Paris, France: Fayard (English translation Questions of Forms: Logic and Analytic Propositions from Kant to Carnap, Minneapolis : University of Minnesota Press)
  • 1990 Dear Carnap, Dear Van: The Quine-Carnap Correspondence and Related Work, ed. by Richard Creath, Berkeley : University of California Press
  • 1991 Maria Grazia Sandrini, Probabilità e Induzione: Carnap e la Conferma come Concetto Semantico, Milano, Italy : Franco Angeli
  • 1991 Erkenntnis Orientated: A Centennial Volume for Rudolf Carnap and Hans Reichenbach, ed. by Wolfgang Spohn, Dordrecht; Boston : Kluwer Academic Publishers
  • 1991 Logic, Language, and the Structure of Scientific Theories: Proceedings of the Carnap-Reichenbach Centennial, University of Konstanz, 21-24 May 1991 Pittsburgh : University of Pittsburgh Press; [Konstanz] : Universitasverlag Konstanz
  • 1995 L'eredità di Rudolf Carnap: Epistemologia, Filosofia delle Scienze, Filosofia del Linguaggio, ed. by Alberto Pasquinelli, Bologna, Italy : CLUEB

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Mauro Murzi

Cleanthes (331—232 B.C.E.)

Cleanthes was a Stoic philosopher of Assus in Lydia, and a disciple of Zeno of Citium. After the death of Zeno he presided over his school. He was originally a wrestler, and in this capacity he visited Athens, where he became acquainted with philosophy. Although he possessed no more than four drachma, he was determined to put himself under an eminent philosopher. His first master was Crates, the Academic. He afterward became Zeno's disciple and an advocate of his doctrines. By night he drew water as a common laborer in the public gardens so that he would have leisure to attend lectures in the daytime. The Athenian citizens observed that, although he appeared strong and healthy, he had no visible means of subsistence; they then summoned him before the Areopagas, according to the custom of the city, to give an account of his manner of living. He then produced the gardener for whom he drew water, and a woman for whom he ground meal, as witnesses to prove that he lived by the labor of his hands. The judges of the court were struck with such admiration of his conduct, that they ordered ten minae to be paid him out of the public treasury. Zeno, however, did not allow him to accept it. Antigonus afterward presented him with three thousand minae. From the manner in which this philosopher supported himself, he was called "the well drawer." For many years he was so poor that he was compelled to take notes on Zeno's lectures on shells and bones, since he could not afford to buy better materials. He remained, however, a pupil of Zeno for nineteen years.

His natural faculties were slow. But resolution and perseverance enabled him to overcome all difficulties. At last he became so complete a master of Stoicism that he was perfectly qualified to succeed Zeno. His fellow disciples often ridiculed him for his dullness by calling him an ass. However, his answer was, that if he were an ass he was the better able to bear the weight of Zeno's doctrine. He wrote much, but none of his writings remain except a hymn to Zeus. After his death, the Roman senate erected a statue in honor of him at Assus. It is said that he starved himself to death in his 99th year.

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The author of this article is anonymous. The IEP is actively seeking an author who will write a replacement article.