Category Archives: Renaissance Philosophy

Jean Bodin (c. 1529—1596)

bodinThe humanist philosopher and jurist Jean Bodin was one of the most prominent political thinkers of the sixteenth century. His reputation is largely based on his account of sovereignty which he formulated in the Six Books of the Commonwealth. Bodin lived at a time of great upheaval, when France was ravaged by the wars of religion between the Catholics and the Huguenots. He was convinced that peace could be restored only if the sovereign prince was given absolute and indivisible power of the state. Bodin believed that different religions could coexist within the commonwealth. His tolerance in religious matters has often been emphasized. He was also one of the first men to have opposed slavery.

Bodin was extremely erudite, and his works discuss a wide variety of topics, extending from natural philosophy and religion to education, political economy, and historical methodology. Natural philosophy and religion where intimately correlated for Bodin. Furthermore, he sought to reform the judicial system of France, and he formulated one of the earliest versions of the quantitative theory of money. Bodin held a superstitious belief about the existence of angels and demons; his works cover topics such as demonology and witchcraft, and include extensive passages on astrology and numerology.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Career
  2. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History
    1. Methodology for the Study of History
    2. Theory of Climates
  3. The Six Bookes of a Commonweale
    1. Concept of Sovereignty
    2. Definition of Law
    3. Limitations upon the Authority of the Sovereign Prince
    4. Difference between Form of State and Form of Government
    5. The Question of Slavery
  4. Bodin’s Economic Thought
    1. Quantitative Theory of Money
    2. The State’s Finances and the Question of Taxation and Property Rights
  5. Writings Concerning Religion
    1. Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Question of Religious Tolerance
    2. The Question of True Religion and Bodin’s Personal Faith
  6. On Witchcraft
  7. Natural Philosophy
  8. Other Works
    1. Juris universi distributio
    2. Moral Philosophy
    3. Writings on Education
    4. Bodin’s Surviving Correspondence
  9. Influence
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Modern Editions of Bodin’s works
        1. Collected Works
        2. Individual Works
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Bibliography
      2. Conference Proceedings and Article Collections

1. Life and Career

Jean Bodin’s last will and testament, dated 7th June 1596, states that he was 66 years old when he died. He was therefore born in either 1529 or 1530, the youngest of seven children, four of whom were girls. Bodin’s father, Guillaume Bodin, was a wealthy merchant and a member of the bourgeoisie of Angers. Very little is known of his mother beyond that her name was Catherine Dutertre and that she died before the year 1561.

Bodin joined the Carmelite brotherhood at an early age. Surviving documents tell us that he was released from his vows a few years later. He is known to have studied, and later, taught law at the University of Toulouse during the 1550s. Bodin was unable to obtain a professorship at the university, and this may have driven him away from Toulouse and academic life. During the 1560s, he worked as an advocate at the Parlement of Paris.

Bodin’s first major work, the Method for the Easy Understanding of History (Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem) was published in 1566, the same year that saw the death of his father. Bodin’s most famous work, the Six Books of the Commonwealth (Six livres de la République) was published ten years later, in 1576. In 1570, Bodin was commissioned by the French King Charles IX for the reformation of forest tenures in Normandy. He was at the very heart of French political power in the 1570s – first during the reign of Charles IX and also, after Charles’ death in 1574, during the reign of his brother, Henri III. In 1576, Bodin lost the favor of King Henri III after he opposed, among other things, the king’s fiscal policies during the States General of Blois where Bodin served as representative for the third estate of Vermandois.

Bodin settled in Laon during the last two decades of his life. He had moved there shortly after marrying the widow of a Laon official, Françoise Trouilliart (or Trouillard) in 1576. Bodin sought employment with the Duke of Alençon, the king’s youngest brother. The duke aspired to marry Queen Elizabeth of England. During one of the duke’s trips to London, Bodin accompanied him. In 1582, Bodin followed Alençon to Antwerp, where Alençon sided with the Low Countries in their revolt against Spain. Bodin was appointed Master of Requests and counselor (maître des requêtes et conseiller) to the duke in 1583. He retired from national politics after Alençon’s sudden death in 1584. Following the death of his brother-in-law, Bodin succeeded him in office as procureur du roi, or Chief Public Prosecutor, for Laon in 1587.

Bodin wrote two notable works toward the end of his life; his Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime (Colloquium heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis) is an engaging dialogue in favor of religious tolerance. Bodin’s main contribution in the field of natural philosophy, the Theater of Nature (Universae naturae theatrum) was first published in 1596, the same year that Bodin died of the plague. He was given a Catholic burial in the Franciscan church of Laon.

2. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History

Bodin’s Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem (Method for the Easy Comprehension of History) was first published in 1566, and revised in 1572. It is Bodin’s first important work and contains many of the ideas that are developed further in his other key systematic works. Some of them are human history, natural history, and divine history, later elaborated in the République, the Theatrum, and the Colloquium heptaplomeres respectively. Bodin’s purpose in writing the Methodus was to expose the art and method to be used in the study of history. His desire to elaborate a system and to synthesize all existing knowledge is easily detectable in the Methodus.

The first four chapters of the Methodus are largely a discussion concerning methodology. History and its different categories are defined in Chapter One. Chapters II and III discuss the order in which historical accounts are to be read, and the correct order for arranging all material. Chapter IV elucidates the choice of historians; it may be considered as an exposition of Bodin’s method for a critical study of history, that the student of history should move from generalized accounts to more detailed narratives. Reading should begin from the earliest times of recorded history and the reader should naturally progress towards more recent times. In order to obtain a thorough comprehension of the whole, certain other subjects – cosmography, geography, chorography, topography and geometry – are to be associated with the study of history. All material should be critically assessed; the background and training of historians must be taken into account, as well as their qualifications.

In order, then, that the truth of the matter may be gleaned from histories, not only in the choice of individual authors but also in reading them we must remember what Aristotle sagely said, that in reading history it is necessary not to believe too much or disbelieve flatly (…)If we agree to everything in every respect, often we shall take true things for false and blunder seriously in administering the state. But if we have no faith at all in history, we can win no assistance from it. (Bodin 1945, 42)

Of the ten chapters that constitute the Methodus, Chapter Six is by far the lengthiest, covering more than a third of the book, and it may be considered as a blueprint for the République. Chapters VII to IX seek to refute erroneous interpretations of history. Bodin’s first rebuttal concerns the myth, based on a biblical prophecy, of the four monarchies or empires as it was emphasized by many German Protestant theologians. Bodin’s second criticism concerns the idea of a golden age (and the superiority of the ancients in comparison with moderns). Furthermore, Bodin refutes the error of those who claim the independent origin of races. The final chapter of the Methodus contains a bibliography of universal history.

a. Methodology for the Study of History

There are three kinds of history, Bodin writes; divine, natural and human. The Methodus is an investigation into the third type, that is, the study of human actions and of the rules that govern them. Science is not concerned with particulars but with universals. Bodin therefore considers as absurd the attempts of jurisconsults to establish principles of universal jurisprudence from Roman decrees or, more generally, from Roman law, thus giving preference to one legal tradition. Roman law concerns the legislation of one particular state – and the laws of particular states are the subject of civil law—and as such change within a brief period of time. The correct study of law necessitates a different approach, one that was already described by Plato: the correct way to establish law and to govern a state is to bring together and compare the legal framework of all the states that have existed, and compile the very best of them. Together with other so-called legal humanists, like Budé, Alciat, and Connan, Bodin held that the proper understanding of universal law could only be obtained by combining the studies of history and law.

Indeed, in history the best part of universal law lies hidden; and what is of great weight and importance for the best appraisal of legislation – the custom of the peoples, and the beginnings, growth, conditions, changes, and decline of all states – are obtained from it. The chief subject matter of this Method consists of these facts, since no rewards of history are more ample than those usually gathered around the governmental form of states. (Bodin 1945, 8)

Bodin writes that there are four kinds of interpreters of law. The most skilled among them are those who are

 ...trained not only by precepts and forensic practice but also in the finest arts and the most stable philosophy, who grasp the nature of justice, not changeable according to the wishes of men, but laid down by eternal law; who determine skillfully the standards of equity; who trace the origins of jurisprudence from ultimate principles; who pass on carefully the knowledge of all antiquity; who, of course, know the power and the dominion of the emperor, the senate, the people, and the magistrates of the Romans; who bring to the interpretation of legislation the discussion of philosophers about laws and state; who know well the Greek and Latin languages, in which the statutes are set forth; who at length circumscribe the entire division of learning within its limits, classify into types, divide into parts, point out with words, and illustrate with examples. (Bodin 1945, 4-6)

b. Theory of Climates

The Theory of Climates is among Bodin’s best-known ideas. Bodin was not the first to discuss the topic; he owes much to classical authors like Livy, Hippocrates, Aristotle and Tacitus, who are referenced by Bodin himself. He also borrows from his contemporaries—especially historians, travelers, and diplomats – like Commines, Machiavelli, Copernicus, and Jean Cardan. Bodin’s observations on climate differed from that of his medieval predecessors, since Bodin was first and foremost interested in the practical implications of a theory: a correct understanding of the laws of the environment must be thought of as the starting point for all policy, laws and institutions (Tooley 1953, 83). Bodin believed that climate and other geographical factors influence, although they do not necessarily determine, the temperament of any given people. Accordingly, the form of state and legislation needs to be adapted to the temperament of the people, and the territory that it occupies.

Three different accounts of the Theory of Climates are found in Bodin’s writings. The earliest version is in Chapter Five of the Methodus. Although this passage contains the general principles of the theory, Bodin does not relate them to contemporary politics. It is in the first chapter of the fifth book of the République that the theory of climates is further amplified, and its relationship to contemporary politics established. Moreover, the Latin translation of the République contains a few notable additions to the theory.

According to Bodin, no one who has written about states has ever considered the question of how to adapt the form of a state to the territory where it is situated (near the sea or the mountains, etc.), or to the natural aptitudes of its people. Bodin holds that, amid the uncertainty and chaos of human history, natural influences provide us with a sure criterion for historical generalization. These stable and unchanging natural influences have a dominant role in molding the personality, physique, and historical character of peoples (Brown 1969, 87-88). This naturalistic approach is, to some extent, obscured by Bodin’s belief in astrology and numerology. Racial peculiarities, the influence of the planets and Pythagorean numbers were all part of Renaissance Platonism. Bodin combined these ideas with geographic determinism that closely followed the theories of Hippocrates and Strabo. (Bodin 1945, xiii)

Ptolemy divided the world into arctic, temperate, and tropic zones. In adopting the Ptolemaic zones Bodin divided earth into areas of thirty degrees from the equator northward. Different peoples have their capabilities and weaknesses. Southern people are contemplative and religious by nature; they are wise but lack in energy. Northern people, on the other hand, are active and large in stature, but lack in sagaciousness. The people of the South are intellectually gifted and thus resemble old men while the Northern people, because of their physical qualities, remind us of youth. Those that live in between these two regions—the men of the temperate zone—lack the excesses of the previous two, while being endowed with their better qualities. They may therefore be described as men in middle life—prudent and therefore gifted to become executives and statesmen. They are the Aristotelian mean between two extremes. The superiority of this third group is stressed by Bodin throughout his writings.

3. The Six Bookes of a Commonweale

Bodin’s most prominent contribution in the field of political philosophy was first published in 1576, and in his own Latin translation a decade later. Significant differences exist between the French and Latin versions of the text. Translations into other languages soon followed: Italian (1588), Spanish (1590), German (1592), and English (1606). The République must be considered, at least partially, as Bodin’s response to the most important political crisis in France during the sixteenth century: the French wars of religion (1562-1598). It was written as a defense of the French monarchy against the so-called Monarchomach writers, among them François Hotman (1524-1590), Theodore Beza (1519-1605) and the author of the Vindiciae contra tyrannos. The Monarchomach writers called for tyrannicide and considered it the role of the magistrates and the Estates General to limit the sovereign power of the ruler, and that this power be initially derived from the people.

Bodin published three different prefaces to the République. The first is an introduction found in all French editions. The second is a prefatory letter in Latin that appears in the French editions from 1578 onwards. The third preface is an introduction to the Latin editions. These three prefaces were an opportunity for Bodin to defend his work against writers who had attacked it. They give us an account of how Bodin’s opinions developed during the years that followed the publication of the République. In 1580, Bodin answered his detractors in a work entitled Apologie de René Herpin pour la République de Jean Bodin. René Herpin was a pseudonym used by Bodin.

The first book of the République discusses the principal ends and aims of the state, its different elements, and the nature and defining marks of sovereign power. In the second book, Bodin discusses different types of states (democracy, aristocracy, and monarchy) and concludes that there cannot exist a mixed state. In Chapter Five, Bodin examines the conditions under which a tyrant, that is, an illegitimate ruler who does not possess sovereign power, may be rightfully killed. A legitimate monarch, on the other hand, may not be resisted by his subjects – even if he should act in a tyrannical manner.

Book Three discusses the different parts of the state: the senate and its role, the role of magistrates and their relationship to sovereign power, and the different degrees of authority among magistrates. Colleges, corporations and universities are also defined and considered. The origin, flourishing and decline of states, and the reasons that influence these changes are the subject of Book Four. Book Five begins with an exposition of the Theory of Climate: laws of the state and the form of government are to be adapted to the nature of each people. Bodin then discusses the climatic variations between the North and South, and how these variations affect the human temperament. The final book of the République opens with the question of cencus and censorship that is, the assessment of each individual’s belongings, and the advantages that can be derived from it. Chapters Two and Three discuss the state’s finances, and the problem of debasement of the coinage. Chapter Four is a comparison of the three forms of state; Bodin argues that royal, or hereditary, (as opposed to elective) monarchy is the best form of state. The Salic law, or law of succession to the throne, is discussed: Bodin holds that the rule of women is against divine, natural, and human law. The Salic law, together with a law forbidding alienation of the public domain, called Agrarian law in the Methodus (Bodin 1945, p. 253), is one of the two fundamental laws, or leges imperii (Fr. loix royales), which impose legal limitations upon the authority of the sovereign prince. Fundamental laws concern the state of the kingdom and are annexed to the crown, and  the sovereign prince therefore cannot detract from them.

The concluding chapter of the République is a discussion concerning the principle of justice in the government of the state. Geometric, arithmetic, and harmonic justice are explained, as well as their relation to the different forms of state. A strong Platonic influence may be detected in the final chapter of the work: a wise ruler establishes harmony within the commonwealth, just as God has established harmony in the universe he has created. Every individual has their proper place and purpose in the commonwealth.

a. Concept of Sovereignty

The République opens with the following definition of a commonwealth: “A Commonweale is a lawfull government of many families, and of that which unto them in common belongeth, with a puissant soveraigntie.” (Bodin 1962, 1) (Fr. “République est un droit gouvernement de plusieurs ménages, et de ce qui leur est commun, avec puissance souveraine.” (Bodin 1583, 1) Lat.“Respublica est familiarum rerumque inter ipsas communium summa potestate ac ratione moderata multitude.” (Bodin 1586, 1)) The meaning of sovereign power is further clarified in Chapter Eight of the first book:

Maiestie or Soveraigntie is the most high, absolute, and perpetuall power over the citisens and subiects in a Commonweale: which the Latins cal Maiestatem, the Greeks akra exousia, kurion arche, and kurion politeuma; the Italians Segnoria, and the Hebrewes tomech shévet, that is to say, The greatest power to command. (Bodin 1962, 84)

Having defined sovereignty, Bodin then defines the meaning of the terms “perpetual” and “absolute”. A person to whom sovereignty is given for a certain period of time, upon the expiration of which they once again become private citizens, cannot be called sovereign. When sovereign power is given to someone for a certain period of time, the person or persons receiving it are but the trustees and custodians of that power, and the sovereign power can be removed from them by the person or persons that are truly sovereign. Sovereignty, therefore, Bodin writes, “is not limited either in power, charge, or time certaine.” Absolute power is the power of overriding ordinary law, and it has no other condition than that which is commanded by the law of God and of nature:

But it behoveth him that is a soveraigne not to be in any sort subiect to the commaund of another … whose office it is to give laws unto his subiects, to abrogat laws unprofitable, and in their stead to establish other: which hee cannot do that is himselfe subiect unto laws, or to others which have commaund over him. And that is it for which the law saith, That the prince is acquitted from the power of the laws[.] (Bodin 1962, 91)

From this and similar passages Bodin derives the first prerogative of a sovereign prince of which he gives the following definition: “Let this be the first and chiefe marke of a soveraigne prince, to bee of power to give laws to all his subiects in generall and to everie one of them in particular ... without consent of any other greater, equall, or lesser than himselfe” (Bodin 1962, 159). All other rights and prerogatives of sovereignty are included in the power of making and repealing laws, Bodin writes, and continues, “so that (to speak properly) a man may say, that there is but this only mark of soveraigne power considering that all other the rights thereof are contained in this”. The other prerogatives include declaring war and making peace, hearing appeals in the last instance, instituting and removing the highest officers, imposing taxes on subjects or exempting them, granting pardons and dispensations, determining the name, value, and measure of the coinage, and finally, requiring subjects to swear their loyalty to their sovereign prince.

Sovereignty and its defining marks or attributes are indivisible, and supreme power within the commonwealth must necessarily be concentrated on a single person or group of persons. Bodin argues that the first prerogative of a sovereign ruler is to give law to subjects without the consent of any other individual. It is from this definition that he derives the logical impossibility of dividing sovereignty, as well as the impossibility of the existence of a mixed state: if sovereignty, in other words, the power to give law, within the state were divided, for example,  between the prince, the nobility, and the people, there would exist in the commonwealth not one, but several agents that possess the power to give law. In such a case, Bodin argues, no one can be called a subject, since all have power to make law. Additionally, no one would be able to give laws to others, since law-givers would be forced to receive law from those upon whom they wish to impose laws. The state would, therefore, be popular or democratic. In the revised Latin edition of the République the outcome of divided sovereignty is described as a state of anarchy since no one would be willing to obey laws.

b. Definition of Law

Bodin writes that there is a great difference between law (Lat. lex; Fr. loi) and right (Lat. jus; Fr. droit). Law is the command of a sovereign prince, that makes use of his power, while right implies that which is equitable. A right connotes something with a normative content; law, on the other hand, has no moral content or normative implications. Bodin writes:

We must presuppose that this word Law, without any other addition, signifieth The right command of him or them, which have soveraigne power above others, without exception of person: be it that such commaundement concerne the subiects in generall, or in particular: except him or them which have given the law. Howbeit to speake more properly, A law is the command of a Soveraigne concerning all his subiects in generall: or els concerning generall things, as saith Festus Pompeius, as a privilege concerneth some one, or some few[.] (Bodin 1962, 156)

c. Limitations upon the Authority of the Sovereign Prince

Although the sovereign prince is not bound by civil law—neither by the laws of his predecessors, which have force only as long as their maker is alive, unless ratified by the new ruler, nor by his own laws—he is not free to do as he pleases, for all earthly princes have the obligation to follow the law of God and of nature. Absolute power is power to override ordinary law, but all earthly princes are subject to divine and natural laws, Bodin writes. To contravene the laws of God, “under the greatnesse of whome all monarches of the world ought to beare the yoke, and to bow their heads in all feare and reverence”, and nature mean treason and rebellion.

Contracts with Subjects and with Foreigners

Bodin mentions a few other things - besides the laws of God and of nature - that limit the sovereign prince’s authority. These include the prince’s contracts with his subjects and foreign princes, property rights of the citizens, and constitutional laws (leges imperii) of the realm. Regarding the difference between contracts and laws, Bodin writes that the sovereign prince is subject to the just and reasonable contracts that he has made, and in the observation of which his subjects have an interest, whilst laws obligate all subjects but not the prince. A contract between a sovereign prince and his subjects is mutually binding and it obligates both parties reciprocally. The prince, therefore, has no advantage over the subject on this matter. The prince must honor is contracts for three reasons: 1) Natural equity, which requires that agreements and promises be kept; 2) The prince’s honor and his good faith, since there is “no more detestable crime in a prince, than to bee false of his oath and promise”; and 3) The prince is the guarantor of the conventions and obligations that his subjects have with each other – it is therefore all the more important that the sovereign prince should render justice for his own act.

Fundamental Laws

Two fundamental laws (leges imperii) are discussed in the République. The first one is the Salic law, or the law of succession to the throne. The Salic law guarantees the continuity of the crown, and determines the legitimate successor (see Franklin 1973, Chapter 5). The other fundamental law is the law against alienation of the royal domain, which Bodin calls “Agrarian law” in the Methodus. As Franklin has observed, “The domain was supposed to have been set aside in order to provide a king with a source of annual income normally sufficient to defray the costs of government” (1973, 73). If the domain is alienated, this signifies lesser income to the crown, and possibly increased taxation upon the citizens. Fundamental laws are annexed and united to the crown, and therefore the sovereign ruler cannot infringe them. But should the prince decide to do so, his successor can always annul that which has been done in prejudice of the fundamental laws of the realm.

Inviolability of Private Property

Finally, Bodin derives from both natural law and the Old Testament that the sovereign prince may not take the private property of his subjects without their consent since this would mean violating the law of God and of nature. He writes: “Now then if a soveraigne prince may not remove the bounds which almightie God (of whom he is the living & breathing image) hath prefined unto the everlasting lawes of nature: neither may he take from another man that which is his, without iust cause” (Bodin 1962, 109; 110). The only exception to the rule, the just causes that Bodin refers to in this passage, concern situations where the very existence of the commonwealth is threatened. In such cases, public interest must be preferred over the private, and citizens must give up their private property in order to guarantee the safety and continuing existence of the commonwealth.

The preceding passage is one among many where the sovereign prince is described by Bodin as the “earthly image of God,” “God’s lieutenant for commanding other men,” or the person “to whom God has given power over us”. It is from this principle regarding the inviolability of private property that Bodin derives that new taxes may not be imposed upon citizens without their consent.

d. Difference between Form of State and Form of Government

Bodin holds that sovereignty cannot be divided – it must necessarily reside in one person or group of persons. Having shown that sovereignty is indivisible, Bodin moves on to refute the widely accepted political myth of the Renaissance that the Polybian model of a mixed state was the optimal form of state. Contrary to the opinions of Polybius, Aristotle, and Cicero, Bodin writes that there are only three types of state or commonwealth: monarchy, where sovereignty is vested with one person, aristocracy, where sovereignty is vested with a minority, and democracy, where sovereignty is vested in all of the people or a majority among them. Bodin’s denial of the possibility of dividing sovereignty directly results in the impossibility of a mixed state in the form that most Renaissance political theorists conceived it. It is with the help of historical and modern examples, most notably of Rome and Venice, that Bodin shows that the states that were generally believed to possess a mixed regime were not really so.

Even though Bodin refuses the idea that there be more than three types of commonwealth, he is willing to accept that there is a variety of governments - that is, different ways to govern the state. The way that the state is governed in no way alters its form nor its structure. Discussion concerning the difference between the form of state and government is found in Book Two. Bodin remarks that despite the importance of the question, no one before him has ever addressed it. All monarchies, aristocracies and popular states are either tyrannical, despotic, or legitimate (i.e. royal). These are not different species of commonwealth, Bodin observes, but diverse ways of governing the state. Tyrannical monarchy is one in which the sovereign ruler violates the laws of God, oppresses his subjects and treats their private property as his own. Tyrannical monarchy must not be confused with despotic monarchy, Bodin writes. Despotic, or lordly, monarchy “is that where the prince is become lord of the goods and persons of his subiects, by law of arms and lawfull warre; governing them as the master of a familie doth his slaves.” Bodin holds that there is nothing unfitting in a prince who has defeated his enemies in a just war, and who governs them under the laws of war and the law of nations. Finally, royal or legitimate monarchy is one in which the subjects obey the laws of the sovereign prince, and the prince in his turn obeys the laws of God and of nature; natural liberty and the right to private property are secured to all citizens.

Although most of Bodin’s examples concern monarchy, he writes that “The same difference is also found in the Aristocratique and popular estate: for both the one and the other may be lawful, lordly, and tirannicall, in such sort as I have said” (Bodin 1962, 200). Bodin qualifies as “absurd” and “treasonable” opinions according to which the constitution of France is a mixture of the three types of state—the Parlement representing aristocracy, the Estates General democracy, and the King representing monarchy.

e. The Question of Slavery

The question of slavery is addressed in Book One, Chapter Five of the République. Bodin is recognized today as one of the earliest advocates of the abolition of slavery. For him, slavery was a universal phenomenon in the sense that slaves exist in all parts of the world, and slavery was widely accepted by the droit des gens. Bodin writes that there are difficulties concerning slavery that have never been resolved. He wishes to answer the following question: “Is slavery natural and useful, or contrary to nature?”

Bodin opposes Aristotle’s opinion (Politics 1254a) according to which slavery is something natural – some people are born to govern and command, while it is the role of others to serve and obey. Bodin admits that “there is certain plausibility in the argument that slavery is natural and useful in the commonwealth.” After all, Bodin continues, the institution of slavery has existed in all commonwealths, and in all ages wise and good men have owned slaves. But if we are to consider the question according to commonly received opinions, thus allowing ourselves to be less concerned with philosophical arguments, we will soon understand that slavery is unnatural and contrary to human dignity.

Bodin’s opposition to slavery is manifold. First of all, he considers slavery in most cases to be unnatural, as the following passage attests: “I confesse that servitude is well agreeing unto nature, when a strong man, rich and ignorant, yeeldeth his obedience and service unto a wise, discreet and feeble poore man: but for wise men to serve fools, men of understanding to serve the ignorant, and the good to serve the bad; what can bee more contrarie unto nature?” (Bodin 1962, 34) Secondly, slavery is an affront to religion since the law of God forbids making any man a slave against their good will and consent. Thirdly, slavery is against human dignity, because of the countless indescribable humiliations that slaves have been forced to suffer. According to one interpretation, Bodin’s opposition to slavery must above all be understood within the context of his opinions concerning the commonwealth in that slavery poses a permanent threat to the stability of the state. Bodin relies on a historical narrative to prove that slavery is incompatible with a stable commonwealth (Herrel 1994, 56). Thus, in the following passage, he states:

Wherefore seeing it is proved by the examples of so many worlds of years, so many inconveniences of rebellions, servile warres, conspiracies eversions and changes to have happened unto Commonweals by slaves; so many murthers, cruelties, and detestable villanies to have bene committed upon the persons of slaves by their lords and masters: who can doubt to affirme it to be a thing most pernitious and daungerous to have brought them into a Commonweale; or having cast them off, to receive them againe? (Bodin 1962, 44)

4. Bodin’s Economic Thought

Bodin’s main economic ideas are expressed in two works: initially, in his Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit, first published in 1568, then in a revised second version, in 1578. The Response is an analysis of the reasons for the significant and continuous price rises that afflicted sixteenth century Europe. It is in this work that Bodin is said to have given one of the earliest formulations of the Quantity Theory of Money. In its most elementary form, the Quantity Theory of Money is the affirmation that money supply directly affects price levels. Chapter Two of the sixth book of the République is a lengthy discussion of the possible resources of the state. There is a partial overlap between the two works since Bodin included certain passages of the Response in his République, and then incorporated them again in a revised form into the second edition of the Response.

a. Quantitative Theory of Money

High inflation was rampant in sixteenth century Europe. It began in Spain, and soon spread to its neighboring states. This was mainly due to the increase in the quantity of precious metals, namely silver and gold, that were brought by boat to Europe from the Spanish colonies in the New World. In 1563, the Chambre des Comptes de Paris decided to investigate the reasons for inflation, and the results of the investigation were published in 1566 in a study entitled The Paradoxes of the Seigneur de Malestroit on the Matter of Money. The author of the study was a man called Jean Cherruies “Seigneur de Malestroit”, of whom we know only fairly little. It was these “paradoxes” that Jean Bodin sought to refute in his work.

Malestroit held that the price rises are simply changes in the unit of account that have been occasioned by debasement, and that prices of precious metals have remained constant for three hundred years.

Bodin refuted Malestroit’s analysis on two counts. First, he was able to show that Malestroit’s use of data was incorrect: Malestroit’s central claim to back up his thesis was the unchanging price of velvet since the fourteenth century. Bodin, however, cast doubt on the fact whether velvet was even known in France at such an early period. Secondly, Bodin was able to demonstrate that debasement alone did not explain the reasons for such major and significant price rises; while debasement was one of the factors that had occasioned such inflation, it was far from being the principal cause.

Bodin lists five major factors as contributory causes for such widespread inflation:  (1) The sudden abundance of precious metals, namely silver and gold, throughout Europe; (2) Monopolies; (3) Scarcity, caused by excessive export trade, quasi non-existing import trade, and waste; (4) Fashionable demand by rich people for certain luxury products; and, finally, (5) Debasement.

Of these five causes, Bodin considered the abundance of precious metals to be the most important.

b. The State’s Finances and the Question of Taxation and Property Rights

In Chapter Two of the final book of the République Bodin discusses the question of the commonwealth securing its finances. Seven possible sources of income are listed. These are: (1) Public domain; (2) Profits of conquests; (3) Gifts from friends; (4) Tributes from allies; (5) Profits of trading ventures; (6) Customs on exports and imports; and, finally, (7) Taxes on the subject. Bodin considers the public domain to be the most honest and the most reliable source of income for the commonwealth. He writes that throughout history sovereign princes and their citizens have taken it as a universal rule that the public domain should be holy, inviolable and inalienable. The inalienability of the public domain is of the utmost importance, Bodin writes, in order that “princes should not bee forced to overcharge their subiects with imposts, or to seeke any unlawfull meanes to forfeit their goods”. The seventh method of raising revenue on Bodin’s list is by levying taxes on the subject, but it may be used only when all other measures have failed and the preservation of the commonwealth demands it.

Bodin considers the inalienability of the public domain, together with the Salic law, to be one of the fundamental laws (Lat. leges imperii; Fr. loix royales) of the state. Like many of his contemporaries, Bodin held that the levying of new taxes without consent was a violation of the property rights of the individual, and, as such, contrary to the law of God and nature. He was particularly firm in opposing new taxation without proper consent and sought confirmation for his opinion in French and European history. One of the main differences between a legitimate ruler and an illegitimate one concerns the question of how each treats the private property of their subjects. Property rights are protected by the law of God and of nature, and therefore, violation of the private property of citizens is a violation of the law of God and of nature. A tyrant makes his subjects into his slaves, and treats their private property as if it were his own.

5. Writings Concerning Religion

The 16th and 17th centuries witnessed fierce internal conflict and power struggles at the heart of Christianity. The country most seriously ravaged by the combat between the Catholics and the Huguenots was France. Furthermore, a world of hugely diverse religious beliefs had been recently unveiled beyond the walls of Christendom, and the question of knowing which religion was the true religion (vera religio), or that which God wanted humanity to follow, needed to be addressed. Bodin’s main contributions concerning religion are Démonomanie, Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Universae naturae theatrum. Additionally, the République contains passages that discuss religion and the stability of the state.

a. Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Question of Religious Tolerance

Bodin’s Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime (Colloquium heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis) is often described as one of the earliest works of comparative religion. It is believed to have been written sometime during the 1580s, although it was circulated in manuscript for nearly three centuries before it was published in its entirety in 1857. The Colloquium is a discussion between seven men of different religions or convictions that have gathered in the home of Coronaeus, a Catholic living in Venice, Italy. The participants are Salomon, a Jew, Octavius, a convert from Catholicism to Islam, Toralba, a natural philosopher, Senamus a skeptic, Fridericus, a Lutheran, and Curtius a Calvinist. The men engage in listening to music, reading, gastronomical delights, and discussions concerning religion.

The Colloquium begins with a story that is told by Octavius. A ship leaves the port of Alexandria as gentle winds blow, but an intensive tempest soon arises. The ship’s captain, terrified by the situation, is forced to drop the anchors, and urges everyone to pray to God. The crewmen, being from many different places and of various confessions, all pray for the one God that they have faith in. The storm calms down eventually and the ship is brought safely to port. When Octavius had finished his story, Coronaeus asked the following question: “Finally, with such a variety of religions represented [on the ship], whose prayers did God heed in bringing the ship safely to port?”

The matter of true religion is discussed in the final three books of the Colloquium heptaplomeres. True religion, Bodin holds, is tolerant of all religions, and accepts different ways to approach God. Leathers Kuntz has observed that “no religion is true whose point of view is not universal, whose expression is not free, whose center does not reflect the intimate harmony of God and nature” (Bodin 2008, xliii). The same opinion is expressed in the Démonomanie and in Bodin’s letter to one Jean Bautru des Matras, an advocate working in Paris. In the latter, Bodin writes that “different opinions concerning religion must not lead you astray, as long as you understand that true religion is nothing else than the turning of a purged soul toward true God”.

b. The Question of True Religion and Bodin’s Personal Faith

Leathers Kuntz has detected three stages in the development of Bodin’s religious thinking. She has argued that Bodin’s religious views became more liberal as he grew older (Bodin 2008, xliii-xliv). In 1559, when he wrote the Discours au Senate et au peuple de Toulouse, Bodin held that people should be brought up publicly in one religion. This he considered as an indispensable element in the cohesiveness of the state. Religious unity should be preserved, and religion should not be debated, since disputations damage religion and cast doubt upon it. When writing the République, Bodin’s main concern was the political stability of the French state. He considered religion to provide for the unity of the state, and as supporting the king’s power. Furthermore, religion strengthened the subjects’ obedience toward their sovereign prince and their respect for the execution of laws. Uniformity of worship must be enforced within the commonwealth when it is possible, but tolerance should become the norm when religious minorities become influential enough to no longer be repressed. The final and most liberal stage of Bodin’s religious opinions becomes most apparent in the Colloquium heptaplomeres, “in which his religious opinions seem to have developed into a kind of theism which leaves each man’s religion, provided he has some, to his own personal conscience” (ibid.).

It is impossible to say anything definitive concerning Bodin’s religious views. We may observe that Bodin’s faith seems less loyal to a particular established church than to a deep sense of honoring God. Bodin’s public religious opinions fluctuated throughout his life. As a consequence, he was accused of many things, including of being a Jew, a Calvinist, a heretical Catholic, and an atheist during his lifetime and after his death. Some scholars have even suggested that there are traces of Nicodemism, or religious dissimulation, in both his works and actions.

Scholars have debated for many years the question of knowing which of the opinions expressed in the Colloquium heptaplomeres should be regarded as Bodin’s personal beliefs. Considering that so many, often contradictory, opinions have been advanced, it may be wise to remark that perhaps “all the speakers represent Bodin’s thinking at one time or another. No one represents his thinking exclusively, but Bodin is sympathetic to some views of each as the dialogue develops. The point seems to be, however, that regardless of Bodin’s approval or disapproval of the religious views represented in the dialogue, he constantly stresses the need for toleration of all religions” (Bodin 2008, xliv). It has also been suggested that Bodin’s opinions and views regarding religious faith are so full of compromise that they ultimately amount to a sort of natural religion. Finally, it has been suggested that Bodin’s writings on the topic of religion “transcended the narrow bounds of confessional religion” (Bodin 1980, 1).

Although Bodin’s understanding of true religion as something profoundly personal, for which no church was required, made him an unorthodox believer in the eyes of many, it seems inconceivable that he should be considered an atheist (Bodin 2008, xxix). In fact, he considered atheism to be extremely dangerous to the commonwealth, as the following passage from the République (4, VII), discussing the difference between atheism and superstition, proves:

 And truely they (in mine opinion) offend much, which thinke that the same punishment is to be appointed for them that make many gods, and them that would have none at all: or that the infinitie of gods admitted, the almightie and everliving God is thereby taken away. For that superstition how great soever it be, doth yet hold men in feare and awe, both of the laws and of the magistrats; as also in mutuall duties and offices one of them towards another: whereas mere Atheisme doth utterly root out of mens minds all the feare of doing evill. (Bodin 1962, 539)

Bodin’s reasons for combating atheism in this passage concern the stability of the state: atheists must not be tolerated in the commonwealth since they hold neither moral nor ethical issues regarding breaking the laws of the state. But Bodin had another reason to detest atheism: atheists are blasphemous because they deny the existence of God.

6. On Witchcraft

Bodin’s De la démonomanie des sorciers (On the Demon-Mania of Witches) was first published in 1580 in French, and soon translated into Latin (1581), German (1581) and Italian (1587). Because of its wide distribution and numerous editions, historians have held it accountable for prosecutions of witches during the years that followed its publication. Many readers have been perplexed by the intolerant character of the Démonomanie. Bodin had a strong belief in the existence of angels and demons, and believed that they served as intermediaries between God and human beings; God intervenes directly in the world through the activity of angels and demons. Demonism, together with atheism and any attempt to manipulate demonic forces through witchcraft or natural magic, was treason against God and to be punished with extreme severity. The principal reason, therefore, to punish someone of witchcraft is “to appease the anger of God, especially if the crime is directly against the majesty of God, as this one is”.

Bodin was given the incentive to write the Démonomanie after he took part in the proceedings against a witch in April 1578. His objective in writing the Démonomanie was to “throw some light on the subject of witches, which seems marvelously strange to everyone and unbelievable to many.” Furthermore, the work was to serve as “a warning to all those who read it, in order to make it clearly known that there are no crimes which are nearly so vile as this one, or which deserve more serious penalties.” Finally, he wished to “respond to those who in printed books try to save witches by every means, so that it seems Satan has inspired them and drawn them to his line in order to publish these fine books” (Bodin 2001, 35-7). Among these “protectors of witches,” as Bodin qualified them, was a German Protestant by the name of Johann Weyer, who considered witches to be delusional and excessively melancholic, and recommended physical healing and religious instruction as a remedy to their condition, rather than corporal or capital punishment. Bodin feared that this might lead judges to consider witches as mentally ill, and, as a consequence, permit them to go without punishment.

The Démonomanie is divided into four books. Book One begins with a set of definitions. Bodin then discusses to what extent men may engage in the occult, and the differences between lawful and unlawful means to accomplish things. He also discusses the powers of witches and their practices: whether witches are able to transform men into beasts, induce or inspire in them illnesses, or perhaps even bring about their death. The final book is a discussion concerning ways to investigate and prosecute witches. Bodin’s severity and his rigorousness in condemning witches and witchcraft is largely based on the contents of the final book of the Démonomanie.

Bodin lists three necessary and indisputable proofs upon which a sentence can be based: (1) Truth of the acknowledged and concrete fact; (2) Testimony of several sound witnesses; and (3) Voluntary confession of the person who is charged and convicted of the crime. Certain other types of evidence, such as public reputation or forced confession, are not regarded by Bodin as indisputable proofs, but simply as “presumptions”, or circumstantial evidence, concerning the guilty nature of the person being charged. Presumptions may serve in the conviction and sentencing of witches in cases where clear proof is lacking.

There are fifteen “detestable crimes” that witches may be guilty of, and even the least of them, Bodin affirms, merits painful death. The death penalty, however, must only be sentenced by a competent judge and based on solid proof that eliminates all possibility of error. In cases where sufficient proof is wanting, where there are neither witnesses, nor confession, nor factual evidence, and where only mere presumptions, even strong ones, exist, Bodin is opposed to a death sentence: “I do not recommend that because of strong presumptions one pass sentence of death – but any other penalty except death...One must be very sure of the truth to impose the death sentence.” Bodin may have considered witchcraft an insult against God, and as such meriting the penalty of death, but he nevertheless believed in the rule of law, as in this other passage where he unequivocally states that “it is better to acquit the guilty than to condemn the innocent” (Bodin 2001, 209-210).

7. Natural Philosophy

The Universae naturae theatrum, which was published in the year of his death in 1596, may be considered as the most systematic exposition of Bodin’s vision of the world. It remains the least studied of his works and has never been translated into English. Bodin himself informs us that the Theatrum was written in 1590. The French translation of the work (Le Théâtre de la nature universelle) was published in 1597.

Ever since the beginning of his career Bodin sought to methodologically study all things, human and divine. He writes:

Of history, that is, the true narration of things, there are three kinds: human, natural, and divine. The first concerns man; the second, nature; the third, the Father of nature. /…/ So it shall come about that from thinking first about ourselves, then about our family, then about our society we are led to examine nature and finally to the true history of Immortal God, that is, to contemplation. (Bodin 1945, 15-16)

The Theatrum is the culmination point of Bodin’s systematic examination of things, and as such it is a deeply religious work. Bodin turns to the study of nature in order to better know God:

And indeed the Theater of Nature is nothing other than the contemplation of those things founded by the immortal God as if a certain tablet were placed under the eyes of every single one so that we may embrace and love the majesty of that very author, his goodness, wisdom, and remarkable care in the greatest matters, in moderate affairs, in matters of the least importance” (Bodin 2008, xxx)

Bodin believed that the French civil wars were occasioned, at least partly, by God’s dissatisfaction – God was punishing the French for their growing irreligious sentiment. The Theatrum has been described as an attack against those arrogant and ungodly philosophers, or naturalists, who wish to explain everything without reference to the creator and father of all things that is God. God is the author of all existing things, and the contemplation of nature brings us closer to Him. Furthermore, contemplating nature makes us love God for the care and goodness that he shows us.

The Theatrum has been written in a pseudo-dialogue form; it is a discussion between an informant, Mystagogus, and his questioner Theorus. The work opens with a short overview of the text, in which Bodin stresses the importance of order for the study of things. This gives him the opportunity to criticize Aristotle, who failed to discuss things in the right order; simpler things must be discussed before more complex ones, and therefore matters of physics should have been discussed after metaphysical things. Arranging all the material that is being considered in a convenient order – simplest notions to be studied first, and difficult ones later – is one of the distinctive characteristics of the Ramist framework of knowledge, as McRae has observed (McRae 1955, 8). McRae considers that, together with the Juris universi distributio, Bodin’s Theatrum “is perhaps the most thoroughly Ramist of any of his works.” Bodin’s two main objectives in the first book of the Theatrum are to prove that there is only one principle in nature, that is, God, and, that it is He who has created this world and He who governs it.

Other topics that Bodin discusses in Book One include matter, form and the causes of things. Furthermore, movement, generation, corruption and growth are considered, as well as things related to them: time and place, void, finitude and infinitude. In Book Two, Bodin examines elements, meteorites, rocks, metals and minerals. Book Three is a discussion on the subjects of the nature of plants and animals. The fourth book contains Bodin’s doctrine concerning soul; angels are also discussed in Book Four. The final book of the Theatrum discusses celestial bodies – their natural movement, the admirable harmony that exists between them, and the structure of the heavens. The final book attests of Bodin’s enmity toward Copernicus’ heliocentric system (Bodin 1596, 554 and especially 574-583); Bodin relies on the writings of Ptolemy, Aristotle, and the Holy Scripture in combating Copernicus. He dismisses Copernicus’ hypothesis concerning the heliocentric system on the grounds that it is “contrary to the evidence of the senses, to the authority of the Scriptures, and incompatible with Aristotelian physics.”

According to a recent interpretation by Blair, Bodin’s objective in writing the Theatrum was first and foremost to combat three impious propositions of ancient philosophy: (1) The eternity of the world; (2) The necessity of the laws of nature; and (3) The mortality of the soul.

Against the Eternity of the World

One solution to the conflict between Aristotelian philosophy of the eternity of the world and the Judeo-Christian account of creation—God has created the world, therefore it is not eternal, had been proposed by Thomas Aquinas. He argued that human reason alone cannot establish whether the world is eternal or not; the problem can be solved only by an appeal to faith and to biblical authority. Bodin’s argument differs from that of Aquinas. Bodin offers a rational demonstration based on “arguments for an all-powerful God, who knows no necessity and has complete free will”. Several scholars have observed that Bodin’s emphasis on divine free will is “characteristic of Christian nominalists like Duns Scotus and of Jewish philosophers like Maimonides” (Blair 1997, 118) The concluding syllogism for the “voluntary first cause” that is God is as follows: “Nothing can be eternal by nature whose first cause is voluntary; but the first cause of the world is voluntary; therefore the world cannot be eternal by nature, since its state and condition depend on the decision and free will of another.” (Blair 1997, 118)

Against Natural Necessity

The second conclusion is drawn from the unlimited freedom of God’s will: not only is it impossible that the world should be eternal, but furthermore it is arranged according to a divine plan. According to Bodin, providential divine governance is twofold: ordinary providence, where laws that govern nature under so-called normal circumstances are chosen by God, and extraordinary providence, where God is able to suspend those laws at will at any time he chooses, in order to intervene in the world (Blair 1997, 120). Bodin offers the following explanation for the existence of apparently useless or evil features of nature. He begins by claiming that everything in creation is good, and evil is simply the absence of good; this same idea is repeated in the Paradoxon. Then he attempts to illustrate, through various examples, that even things that are apparently evil in nature serve a “useful purpose in God’s good and wise plan” (Blair 1997, 122).

Immortality of the Soul

Bodin’s demonstration concerning the immortality of the soul is based on the soul’s intermediate nature: the soul is both corporeal and immortal. Blair defines this particular demonstration as “possibly Bodin’s most noteworthy innovation” and as a “significant departure from the standard or orthodox accounts [concerning the soul]” (Blair 1997, 137; 142). In combating the mortality of the soul, Blair writes, Bodin is reacting against all forms of impious philosophizing: against Averroes for denying the personal immortality of the soul; against Pomponazzi for claiming that philosophy shows the soul to be mortal; and against all those, like Pomponazzi or even Duns Scotus, who deny the rational demonstrability of this central doctrine. But Bodin calls his opponents only “Epicureans,” using the term to designate at first, generally, those who doubt the immortality of the soul, then more specifically those who, barely above the level of brutes, take pleasure and pain as the measure of good and evil and believe in the random distribution of atoms. (Blair 1997, 138)

Bodin’s first argument in favor of the immortality of the soul is based on empirical evidence concerning the ability of the soul to function independently of the body: during ecstatic experiences, as these have been conveyed by many learned men, it has been reported that the soul is able to hear, feel and understand while being temporarily transported outside the living body. Two further demonstrations follow. First, Bodin affirms that extremes are always joined by intermediates; passing from one extreme to another always necessitates passing through a 'middle' being and that there exists only two extremes in the world; (1) Form completely separated from matter, meaning angels and demons, and (2) Form entirely concrete, inseparable from matter, except by destruction, that is, natural bodies. Between these two extremes there must necessarily exist some intermediate which joins the two. This intermediate is form separable from matter, or, as Bodin states it, the soul. He concludes: “if therefore the human soul [mens] is separable from the dead body, it follows necessarily that it survives and carries out its actions without the operation of the senses” (Blair 1997, 139). Bodin’s final demonstration is as follows:

Given the extremes, of which one is totally corruptible (natural elements or bodies) and one is totally incorruptible (angels and demons), there must be an intermediate, which is corrupted in one part of itself, but free from corruption in the other; but this is nothing other than man, who participates in both natures: brute elements, plants, stones are far inferior to man in worth and dignity, and since man alone associates with angels and demons, he alone can link the celestial to the terrestrial, superior to inferior, immortal to mortal. (Blair 1997, 139)

Humans participate in both extremes and yet form an entity that is distinct from them. According to the standard view, the corporeal body is connected with the incorporeal soul, but Bodin’s demonstration is not built on this distinction because, for him, the soul is both immortal and corporeal. As Blair has observed, “for Bodin the human hypostasis mediates between form separated from matter (disembodied souls and angels) and form fully embedded in matter (as in all natural bodies), by virtue of its soul, which is corporeal, yet separable from the material body” (Blair 1997, 139-40). The following passage elucidates Bodin’s rather peculiar demonstration:

The body of the soul is not material, but spiritual – yet corporeal nonetheless: “from which it follows that human souls, angels and demons consist of the same corporeal nature, but not of bone, nor of flesh, but of an invisible essence. Like air, or fire, or both, or of a celestial essence, surpassing with its fineness the most subtle bodies: thus, even if we grant it is a spiritual body, it is a body nonetheless.” (Blair 1997, 140)

According to Blair, Bodin constructs a new type of natural philosophy that seeks to combine religion with philosophy, a combination of philosophical research concerning causes with a pious recognition of divine providence and the greatness of God.

Although Bodin often refers to Holy Scripture, he also constantly reminds us of the importance of reason and reasoning – so long as we do not infringe upon the limits of reason. Bodin uses physics to serve religious ends and the fundamental principle behind Bodin’s strategy is the Augustinian precept, later adopted by Aquinas in his synthesis of reason and faith, that truth is one and that there is, indeed, unity of knowledge: a necessary agreement between philosophy and religion exists, and therefore “natural philosophy as a reasoned investigation can never contradict true religion” (Blair 1997, 143).

8. Other Works

a. Juris universi distributio

The Juris universi distributio (Fr. Exposé du droit universel) was first published in 1578, but, as the Dedicatory Epistle of the Methodus informs us, it already existed in manuscript form twelve years earlier. Unlike later editions of the work that were published as books, the first edition of the Distributio was in the form of a poster, measuring approximately 40 by 180 cm, to be hung on the walls of universities.

Bodin’s objective in writing the Juris universi distributio was to arrive at a systematization of universal law. He sought to realize this by the study of history, paired with a comparative method which analyzes the different legal systems that either currently exist or have existed in the past. Bodin uses the same method in his main political works, (République and Methodus), in which comparative public law and its historical study permit Bodin to erect a theory of the state. Bodin is interested in “universal history”, of which his Methodus is an example, in the same way that he is interested in “universal law”, and it seems that the same type of historical and comparative method may be used in discovering them.

According to Bodin, law is divided into two categories: natural (ius naturale) and human (ius humanum). Bodin thus rejects the common threefold division based on the Digest – natural law, law of peoples and civil law –  because he considers dichotomy more convenient. The two principal divisions of human law are ius civile (civil law) and ius gentium (law of peoples). Bodin strongly criticizes law professors, or Romanists, for he writes that they have concentrated almost exclusively on ius civile – particularly the civil law of the Romans - and that, as a consequence, the ius gentium has not been properly studied, and, therefore, has no proper methodology. Bodin’s personal interest lies precisely in the ius gentium because it is concerned with the universal laws that are common to all peoples. The methods of the Romanists are inadequate for the study of ius gentium because the ius civile varies from state to state and no universally valid truths can be derived from it; in this sense it is not even part of legal science. A new critical method is therefore required; a method that is both historical and comparative.

Bodin’s system of universal law is a drastic rupture with the exegetical methods of the Middle Ages. Medieval jurists applied Roman law to their own societies and saw no problem in doing so. It is with the arrival of the so-called humanist scholars, in the sixteenth century, and their use of the methods of classical philology, that the internal coherence and authority of the Corpus juris civilis were challenged.

b. Moral Philosophy

Bodin’s Paradoxon quod nec virtus ulla in mediocritate nec summum hominis bonum in virtutis actione consistere possit (Fr. Paradoxe de Jean Bodin qu’il n’y a pas de vertu en médiocrité ni au milieu de deux vices) was first published in Latin in 1596, although Bodin had completed the text in 1591. Two French translations were later published. Bodin’s own translation dates from 1596, but it remained unpublished until 1598. Bodin’s translation may be considered as a revised version of the Latin text, rather than its simple translation. The Latin edition includes a preface that does not exist in the French version.

The Paradoxon has been written in dialogue form, and is a discussion between a father and a son. During the course of the dialogue, the son repeatedly refers to the authority of Aristotle. His opinions are often refuted by the father, who refers to the writings of Plato and to the Holy Scripture. The term “paradox” in the title refers to the fact that Bodin acknowledges his views to be in contradiction with the moral opinions that were generally accepted in his day – especially concerning the Aristotelian doctrine of the mean.

The work opens with a discussion concerning the question of good and evil and that of divine justice. This is followed by an outline of the basic structure of Bodin’s moral philosophy: God is the sovereign good, or, “that which is the most useful and the most necessary to every imaginable creature”. He is also the source of all other things that are good. Evil is defined as the privation of good – a definition that Bodin traces to St. Augustine. The same definition is found in the Theatrum, where it is used to support the argument that everything in Creation is good – God has not created anything evil (Blair 1997, 122). The good of man and a contented life are discussed, followed by a discussion concerning particular virtues and vices, as well as their origins. Bodin refutes Aristotle’s doctrine of the mean. Discussion concerning moral and intellectual virtues follows. Bodin then examines prudence; he then claims that prudence alone helps us choose between good and evil. The final section discusses wisdom and the love of God. The father affirms that wisdom is found in the fear of offending God. Fear of God is inseparable from love of God – together they form the basis of wisdom.

c. Writings on Education

Bodin wrote or compiled four works where he discusses the education of children: The Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth, Epître à son neveu, Sapientia moralis epitome, and Consilium de institutione principis aut alius nobilioris ingenii. The earliest of them, the Oratio, is a discourse that was given in Toulouse in 1559, and published the same year. The three other works date from a later period; the Epître is a letter written to Bodin’s nephew, dated November 1586, and the Epitome was first published in 1588. Evidence within the Consilia suggests that it was written sometime between 1574 and 1586, although it remained unpublished until 1602.

Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth

Bodin’s Oratio de instituenda in repub. juventute ad senatum populumque tolosatem (Fr. Le discours au sénat et au peuple de Toulouse sur l’éducation à donner aux jeunes gens dans la république) is the most valuable single document that informs us of Bodin’s stay in Toulouse in the 1550's. Furthermore, it is Bodin’s earliest surviving work on education and contains a detailed portrayal of the humanist ideal that Bodin embraced during this period.

Nothing is more salutary to a city than to have those who shall one day rule the nation be educated according to virtue and science. It is only by providing youth with proper education and intellectual and moral culture that the glory of France, and that of its cities could be preserved. Art and science are the auxiliaries of virtue, and one cannot conceive of living – much less leading a happy life – without them. Bodin urges the people of Toulouse to participate in the movement of the Renaissance. The town is well-known for its faculty of law, and he argues that the study of humanities and belles-lettres should also be appended to the study of law.

In Bodin's time, the children of Toulouse were either given a public education – in which case they were most often sent to Paris – or taught privately, in domicile. While both systems have their inconveniences, Bodin considers that public schooling must be favored. In order to prevent children from being sent to Paris to be educated, however, a collège must be built in Toulouse and the children of Toulouse should be educated in their own hometown. Bodin proposes that all children – including gifted children belonging to the poorest classes – be sent to public schools where they shall be taught according to the official method.

Epître de Jean Bodin touchant l’institution de ses enfants à son neveu

This short work is Bodin’s response in the form of a letter dated November 9, 1586, to his nephew’s enquiry concerning the education of children. Bodin’s nephew had welcomed a newborn son to his family, and had turned to Bodin for advice on how to give him a proper education. Bodin’s advice came in the form of a description of how he taught his own children when they were three and four years old.

Bodin began by teaching his children the Latin names of things. Having observed that they have a good memory and necessary mental capacities, Bodin asked them to repeat more abstract words, and began informing them about such things as how old the world is (5,534 years), how many planets there are, and the names of these planets. He taught them the names of body parts, what senses we have, the virtues and vices, and so forth. Knowledge of different things was acquired by a continuous daily exercise. Soon after, Bodin had his children interrogate each other, thus allowing himself to retire from this task. The study of Latin grammar soon followed, as well as the study of moral sentences in both French and Latin. The children would then begin the study of arithmetic and geometry. This was followed by the translation of Cicero’s writings from Latin to French.

Sapientia moralis epitome 

The Sapientia moralis epitome was published in Paris in 1588. It consists of 210 moral maxims that have been arranged into groups of seven sentences. Each group is a discussion upon a common topic: youth and education, nature, truth and opinion, virtue, war, liberty, marriage, etc. The majority of the maxims are Bodin’s own formulations of ideas expressed by Ovid, Horace, Juvenale and Lucretius.

Consilium de institutione principis

Bodin’s Consilium de institutione principis was first published in 1602 as part of a compilation entitled Consilia Iohannis Bodini Galli et Fausti Longiani Itali de principe recte instituendo. Although the determination of a precise date seems impossible, evidence within the work suggests that Bodin composed it sometime between 1574 and 1586.

The Consilium is a collection of precepts for the young princes of the Saxon court. The content of the Consilium is in many ways identical to the views that were expressed in the Epître, although the Consilium is more detailed. Young princes are to be taught in small groups, and their eating and sleeping habits are to be observed, so that they remain alert and in good health.

Bodin particularly recommends the study of two texts: Peter Ramus’ Dialectica, and Pibrac du Faur’s Quatrains. The education of the princes is to be completed by the study of law and the art of government. Knowledge of practical matters should be acquired by studying “the state of the republica and its offices and the laws, customs and natures of various peoples.” Knowledge in practical matters is necessary in order to acquire prudence. According to Bodin, only a prudent prince is worthy of his people (Rose 1980, 57-58).

d. Bodin’s Surviving Correspondence

Several letters from Bodin’s personal correspondence have survived to the present day; (for the complete list, see Couzinet 2001, 32-36). Chauviré published a series of letters as an Appendix to his Jean Bodin, auteur de la République. The most important among them are Bodin’s letter, written in Latin, to one Jean Bautru des Matras, as well as Bodin’s account from January 1583, addressed to his brother-in-law, regarding the events that took place in Antwerp when the Duke of Alençon was trying to help the Low Countries in their efforts to drive out the Spanish.

Later, Moreau-Reibel made a discovery in France’s Bibliothèque Nationale, recueil manuscrit 4897 of the library’s fonds français, and published a series of five letters that had been brought together by a certain Philippe Hardouyn. These letters were written between 1589-93. Together they complete our understanding of the possible reasons that made Bodin a ligueur. A sixth letter from this same period is Bodin’s notorious letter of 20 January 1590, in which he explains the reasons that made him a supporter of the Catholic League. A couple of letters from the correspondence between Bodin and Walsingham, dating from 1582, have also survived.

9. Influence

As the work’s numerous editions and translations attest, Bodin’s République was widely read in Europe after its publication, up until the mid-seventeenth century. It was subsequently forgotten, however, and Bodin’s influence during the eighteenth century was only marginal. It was not until the twentieth century that his works, slowly, but decisively, began to interest scholars again. Growing interest in his works has assured Bodin the place he deserves among the most important political thinkers of the sixteenth century. New translations and modern editions of his works have made his ideas accessible to wider audiences.

Among Bodin’s best-known ideas is the Theory of Climate that is currently most often associated with another French philosopher, Montesquieu (1689-1755). Bodin’s comparative and empirical approach in the fields of historical methodology, jurisprudence, and religion represented a break with medieval traditions. He was among the most influential legal philosophers of his time, and his Colloquium heptaplomeres is one of the earliest works of comparative religious studies. Bodin’s ideas concerning religious tolerance and the abolition of slavery found an echo among European writers of both the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. Although the Colloquium heptaplomeres remained unpublished until the 1840s, scholars were familiar with its ideas due to manuscript copies that circulated in Europe. The numerous editions of his Démonomanie, on the other hand, testify to an interest previously demonstrated toward his ideas regarding witchcraft. Finally, Bodin’s Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit includes one of the earliest formulations of the Quantity Theory of Money.

In political theory, Bodin’s most influential contribution remains his Theory of Sovereignty, and the conceptualization of sovereign power. A majority of scholars have labeled Bodin as an absolutist. For others, he favored a type of constitutionalism. Still others have observed that he shifted from the perceived constitutionalism of his early writings toward a more absolutist theory in the République. His writings were received in various ways in different parts of Europe, and interpretations regarding them were often contradictory – depending on the country. His Theory of Sovereignty was used by royalists and parliamentarians alike to defend their widely differing opinions. In France, for example, his political theory was largely absorbed into the absolutist movement and the doctrine of the divine right of kings that became highly influential soon after Bodin’s death; one needs only to think of Cardinal Richelieu and Louis XIV. For example, Jacques-Bénigne Bossuet (1627-1704), who was tutor to the oldest son of Louis XIV, argued in favor of an absolute hereditary monarchy from Scriptural sources in his Politics Drawn from the Very Words of Holy Scripture (Politique tirée des propres paroles de l'Écriture sainte). Other French writers who incorporated absolutist elements from Bodin’s theory in their own writings are Pierre Grégoire de Toulouse (c. 1540-1597), Charles Loyseau (1566-1627), and Cardin Le Bret (1558-1655).

The term “monarchomachs” (Fr., monarchomaques) denotes the writers – Protestants or Catholics – who opposed the powers of the monarch. The term was first coined by the Scottish jurist and royalist William Barclay (1546-1608) in his De Regno et Regali Potestate (1600). Similar to what Bodin had done in his République, Barclay defended the rights of kings. Giovanni Botero (1544-1617) was one of the earliest writers to have used the expression “reason of state” (Fr., Raison d’état) in his work Della ragion di Stato (1589). Bodin’s political writings may have been one of the sources used by Botero and his followers.

In Germany, Johannes Althusius (1557-1638) adopted Bodin’s theory of sovereignty in his Politica methodice digesta (1603), but argued that the community is always sovereign. In this sense, every commonwealth – no matter what its form may be – is popular. Dutch jurist Hugo Grotius published his renowned De jure belli ac pacis in 1625; Grotius does not conceal his admiration for Bodin, nor for the method used by French writers that consisted of combining the study of history with the study of law.

Bodin’s République was among the works that introduced the idea of legislative sovereignty in England. His considerable influence upon Elizabethan and Jacobean political thought in England, one scholar has observed, was largely due to his precise definition of sovereignty. Among the political writers who defended the powers of the king, Sir Robert Filmer (c. 1588-1653) drew heavily upon Bodin’s writings. One shorter text, in particular, The Necessity of the Absolute Power of all Kings and in particular of the King of England,  published in 1648, is hardly anything more than a collection of ideas expressed in the République. John Locke’s First Treatise of Government (1689) may, therefore, be considered not only a refutation of Filmer’s political ideas, but also a critical commentary upon Bodin’s political theory. Thomas Hobbes, in his The Elements of Law (1640), cites Bodin by name and approves Bodin’s opinion according to which sovereign power in the commonwealth may not be divided (II.8.7. “Of the Causes of Rebellion”). This principle of indivisible sovereign power is also expressed in Hobbes’ later political works De cive (1642) and Leviathan (1651).

10. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Oppiani De venatione (1555)
  • Oratio de instituenda iuventute… (1559)
  • Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem (1566)
  • La réponse aux paradoxes de Malestroit (1568)
  • La harangue de Messire Charles des Cars (1573)
  • Les Six Livres de la République (1576; all references in this article are to the edition of 1583)
  • Apologie de Réne Herpin pour la République (before 1581)
  • Recueil de tout ce qui s’est négocié en la compagnie du tiers état… (1577)
  • Juris universi distributio (1578)
  • De la démonomanie des sorciers (1580)
  • De republica libri sex (1586)
  • Sapientiae moralis epitome (1588)
  • Paradoxon (1596)
  • Universae naturae theatrum (1596)
  • Consilia de principe recte instituendo (1602)
  • Colloquium heptaplomeres (1841)
  • Epître de Jean Bodin touchant l’institution de ses Enfans de 1586 (1841)

i. Modern Editions of Bodin’s works

1. Collected Works
  • Bodin, Jean. Oeuvres philosophiques de Jean Bodin. Ed. Pierre Mesnard. Trans. Pierre Mesnard.  Paris: PUF, 1951.
    • Includes the following Latin works, together with their French translations: Oratio de instituenda in repub. juventute ad senatum populumque tolosatemJuris universi distributio, and Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem.
  • Bodin, Jean. Selected Writings on Philosophy, Religion and Politics. Ed. Paul L. Rose. Genève: Droz, 1980.
    • Includes the following seven works: Bodin’s letter to his nephew (1586), Consilium de institutione principis (1574-86), Sapientia moralis epitome (1588), Latin dedicatory letter to the Paradoxon quod nec virtus ulla in mediocritate nec summum hominis bonum in virtutis actione consistere possit (1596) and the French translation of the text, Le Paradoxe de Jean Bodin Angevin (1598), Bodin’s letter to Jean Bautru des Matras (1560s), as well as a letter to a friend in which he gives reasons for supporting the Catholic League (1590).
2. Individual Works
  • Bodin, Jean. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History. Trans. Beatrice Reynolds. New York: Columbia University Press, 1945.
    • Includes an introduction by Reynolds.
  • Bodin, Jean. Six Books of the Commonwealth. Abr. ed. Trans. Marian J. Tooley. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1955.
    • An abridgment of Bodin’s major work, together with an introduction.
  • Bodin, Jean. The Six Bookes of a Commonweal. Trans. Richard Knolles. Ed. Kenneth Douglas McRae. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1962.
    • This is the only existing full English translation of the work; facsimile reprint of Knolles’ English translation of 1606 that compares the French and Latin versions of the text. McRae’s introductory material discusses Bodin’s life, his career and his influence.
  • Bodin, Jean. Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on Education of Youth in the Commonwealth. Trans. George Albert Moore. Chevy Chase, Md: Country Dollar Press, 1965.
    • Moore’s translation of an important and interesting early text by Bodin.
  • Bodin, Jean. Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime. Trans. Marion Leathers Kuntz. Princeton, N. J.: Princeton University Press, 1975. Second edition. University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008.
    • First complete modern translation of the work, together with highly informative introductory material.
  • Bodin, Jean. On Sovereignty. Trans. Julian H. Franklin. Ed. Julian H. Franklin. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • Contains chapters 8 and 10 of the First book, and chapters 1 and 5 of the Second book of the République. Concentrates on Bodin’s analysis of sovereignty. Franklin’s textual notes are informative.
  • Bodin, Jean. Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit. Trans. Henry Tudor. Eds. Henry Tudor and R. W. Dyson. Bristol: Thoemmes Continuum, 1997.
    • Most recent English translation of the text, it is based on the first edition of the work, but also included are the major changes that occurred between the first (1568) and second (1578) editions. Includes a concise and useful introduction.
  • Bodin, Jean. On the Demon-Mania of Witches. Abr. ed. Trans. Randy A. Scott and Jonathan L. Pearl. Toronto: Centre for Reformation and Renaissance Studies, 2001.
    • Abridged translation of Bodin’s Démonomanie that contains about two-thirds of the original text and informative notes.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Blair, Ann. The Theater of Nature. Jean Bodin and Renaissance Science. Princeton, N. J.: Princeton University Press, 1997.
    • Indispensable study concerning the methods and practices of Renaissance science in the light of Bodin’s Theatrum.
  • Brown, John L. The Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem of Jean Bodin. Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 1939. Reprint. New York: AMS Press, 1969.
    • Central study that analyses the background and influence of Bodin’s Methodus. Brown establishes that Bodin’s earlier work contains many of the political and legal principles that were further developed in the République.
  • Franklin, Julian H. Jean Bodin and the Rise of Absolutist Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • An influential study on the topic of the formation of Bodin’s absolutist view, as it is expressed in the République.
  • Heller, Henry. “Bodin on Slavery and Primitive Accumulation.” The Sixteenth Century Journal 25.1 (1994): 53-65.
    • Argues that Bodin conceived of slavery not only as something irrational and unnatural, but as a permanent threat to the stability of the state.
  • McRae, Kenneth D. “Ramist Tendencies in the Thought of Jean Bodin.” Journal of the History of Ideas 16.3 (1955): 306-323.
    • Argues that several of Bodin’s writings reveal the influence of Ramist concepts; even the République (in which the Ramist influence is less evident) can be described as Ramist in its structure.
  • O’Brien, Denis P. “Bodin’s Analysis of Inflation.” History of Political Economy 32.2 (2000): 267-292.
    • A longer version of the introduction that O’Brien wrote to the 1997 edition of Bodin’s Response. Argues that Bodin should be regarded as the pioneer formulator of the quantity theory of money.
  • Pearl, Jonathan L. “Humanism and Satanism: Jean Bodin’s Contribution to the Witchcraft Crisis.” Canadian Review of Sociology and Anthropology 19.4 (1982): 541-548.
    • On Bodin’s influence on the “witchcraft crisis”. Pearl reminds us that the Renaissance witnessed, not only a revival of the arts and the birth of modern science, but also the re-appearance of the occult: magic, astrology and witchcraft.
  • Remer, Gary. “Dialogues of Toleration: Erasmus and Bodin.” Review of Politics 56.2 (1994): 305-336.
    • Examines two different types of dialogues of toleration; Erasmus' common truth and Bodin's subjective. Erasmus’ traditional conception aims at the discovery of truth in religious questions; Bodin’s conception, on the contrary, does not presuppose that a common truth may be discovered, since every opinion is one part of the truth.
  • Rose, Paul Lawrence. Bodin and the Great God of Nature. The Moral and Religious Universe of a Judaiser. Genève: Droz, 1980.
    • A valuable study concerning Bodin’s ideas on religion and ethics; many of Bodin’s less-known works are considered. Rose argues that Bodin went through three religious conversions in his lifetime.
  • Salmon, John Hearsey McMillan. “The Legacy of Jean Bodin: Absolutism, Populism or Constitutionalism?” The History of Political Thought 17. Thorverton (1996): 500-522.
    • Discusses the ways in which Bodin’s ideas were understood and transformed in France’s neighboring countries during the seventeenth century.
  • Tooley, Marian J. “Bodin and the Mediaeval Theory of Climate.” Speculum 28.1 (1953): 64-83.
    • A scholarly investigation of Bodin’s medieval predecessors regarding the theory of climates. Argues that contrary to his predecessors, Bodin was more interested in the practical implications of the things he observed.
  • Ulph, Owen. “Jean Bodin and the Estates-General of 1576.” Journal of Modern History 19.4 (1947): 289-296.
    • Examines Bodin’s role, as deputy from the bailiwick of Vermandois, during the estates-general at Blois in 1576.
  • Wolfe, Martin. “Jean Bodin on Taxes: The Sovereignty-Taxes Paradox.” Political Science Quarterly 83.2 (1968): 268-284.
    • Argues that Bodin’s main objective in writing about taxes was to push for reform in France’s fiscal system.

i. Bibliography

  • Couzinet, Marie-Dominique, ed. Jean Bodin. Roma: Memini, 2001.
    • Indispensable for conducting serious research on Bodin. Contains references to over 1,500 articles, books and other documents.

ii. Conference proceedings and Article Collections

  • Denzer, Horst, ed. Jean Bodin – Proceedings of the International Conference on Bodin in Munich. München: C.H. Beck, 1973.
    • Fine collection of twenty-four articles (in English, French and German) by the foremost Bodin scholars. Part II contains discussions, and part III an exhaustive bibliography on Bodin from the year 1800 onwards.
  • Franklin, Julian H., ed. Jean Bodin. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006.
    • Collection of twenty previously published articles or book chapters (in English).


Author Information

Tommi Lindfors
University of Helsinki

Renaissance Philosophy

The Renaissance, that is, the period that extends roughly from the middle of the fourteenth century to the beginning of the seventeen century, was a time of intense, all-encompassing, and, in many ways, distinctive philosophical activity. A fundamental assumption of the Renaissance movement was that the remains of classical antiquity constituted an invaluable source of excellence to which debased and decadent modern times could turn in order to repair the damage brought about since the fall of the Roman Empire. It was often assumed that God had given a single unified truth to humanity and that the works of ancient philosophers had preserved part of this original deposit of divine wisdom. This idea not only laid the foundation for a scholarly culture that was centered on ancient texts and their interpretation, but also fostered an approach to textual interpretation that strove to harmonize and reconcile divergent philosophical accounts. Stimulated by newly available texts, one of the most important hallmarks of Renaissance philosophy is the increased interest in primary sources of Greek and Roman thought, which were previously unknown or little read. The renewed study of Neoplatonism, Stoicism, Epicureanism, and Skepticism eroded faith in the universal truth of Aristotelian philosophy and widened the philosophical horizon, providing a rich seedbed from which modern science and modern philosophy gradually emerged.

Table of Contents

  1. Aristotelianism
  2. Humanism
  3. Platonism
  4. Hellenistic Philosophies
  5. New Philosophies of Nature
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Aristotelianism

Improved access to a great deal of previously unknown literature from ancient Greece and Rome was an important aspect of Renaissance philosophy. The renewed study of Aristotle, however, was not so much because of the rediscovery of unknown texts, but because of a renewed interest in texts long translated into Latin but little studied, such as the Poetics, and especially because of novel approaches to well-known texts. From the early fifteenth century onwards, humanists devoted considerable time and energy to making Aristotelian texts clearer and more precise. In order to rediscover the meaning of Aristotle’s thought, they updated the Scholastic translations of his works, read them in the original Greek, and analyzed them with philological techniques. The availability of these new interpretative tools had a great impact on the philosophical debate. Moreover, in the four decades after 1490, the Aristotelian interpretations of Alexander of Aphrodisias, Themistius, Ammonius, Philoponus, Simplicius, and other Greek commentators were added to the views of Arabic and medieval commentators, stimulating new solutions to Aristotelian problems and leading to a wide variety of interpretations of Aristotle in the Renaissance period.

The most powerful tradition, at least in Italy, was that which took Averroes’s works as the best key for determining the true mind of Aristotle. Averroes’s name was primarily associated with the doctrine of the unity of the intellect. Among the defenders of his theory that there is only one intellect for all human beings, we find Paul of Venice (d. 1429), who is regarded as the founding figure of Renaissance Averroism, and Alessandro Achillini (1463–1512), as well as the Jewish philosopher Elijah del Medigo (1458–1493). Two other Renaissance Aristotelians who expended much of their philosophical energies on explicating the texts of Averroes are Nicoletto Vernia (d. 1499) and Agostino Nifo (c. 1469–1538). They are noteworthy characters in the Renaissance controversy about the immortality of the soul mainly because of the remarkable shift that can be discerned in their thought. Initially they were defenders of Averroes’s theory of the unity of the intellect, but from loyal followers of Averroes as a guide to Aristotle, they became careful students of the Greek commentators, and in their late thought both Vernia and Nifo attacked Averroes as a misleading interpreter of Aristotle, believing that personal immortality could be philosophically demonstrated.

Many Renaissance Aristotelians read Aristotle for scientific or secular reasons, with no direct interest in religious or theological questions. Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525), one of the most important and influential Aristotelian philosophers of the Renaissance, developed his views entirely within the framework of natural philosophy. In De immortalitate animae (Treatise on the Immortality of the Soul, 1516), arguing from the Aristotelian text, Pomponazzi maintained that proof of the intellect’s ability to survive the death of the body must be found in an activity of the intellect that functions without any dependence on the body. In his view, no such activity can be found because the highest activity of the intellect, the attainment of universals in cognition, is always mediated by sense impression. Therefore, based solely on philosophical premises and Aristotelian principles, the conclusion is that the entire soul dies with the body. Pomponazzi’s treatise aroused violent opposition and led to a spate of books being written against him. In 1520, he completed De naturalium effectuum causis sive de incantationibus (On the Causes of Natural Effects or On Incantations), whose main target was the popular belief that miracles are produced by angels and demons. He excluded supernatural explanations from the domain of nature by establishing that it is possible to explain those extraordinary events commonly regarded as miracles in terms of a concatenation of natural causes. Another substantial work is De fato, de libero arbitrio et de praedestinatione (Five Books on Fate, Free Will and Predestination), which is regarded as one of the most important works on the problems of freedom and determinism in the Renaissance. Pomponazzi considers whether the human will can be free, and he considers the conflicting points of view of philosophical determinism and Christian theology.

Another philosopher who tried to keep Aristotle’s authority independent of theology and subject to rational criticism, is Jacopo Zabarella (1533–1589), who produced an extensive body of work on the nature of logic and scientific method. His goal was the retrieval of the genuine Aristotelian concepts of science and scientific method, which he understood as the indisputable demonstration of the nature and constitutive principles of natural beings. He developed the method of regressus, a combination of the deductive procedures of composition and the inductive procedures of resolution that came to be regarded as the proper method for obtaining knowledge in the theoretical sciences. Among his main works are the collected logical works Opera logica (1578), which are mainly devoted to the theory of demonstration, and his major work on natural philosophy, De rebus naturalibus (1590). Zabarella’s work was instrumental in a renewal of natural philosophy, methodology, and theory of knowledge.

There were also forms of Aristotelian philosophy with strong confessional ties, such as the branch of Scholasticism that developed on the Iberian Peninsula during the sixteenth century. This current of Hispanic Scholastic philosophy began with the Dominican School founded in Salamanca by Francisco de Vitoria (1492–1546) and continued with the philosophy of the newly founded Society of Jesus, among whose defining authorities were Pedro da Fonseca (1528–1599), Francisco de Toledo (1533–1596), and Francisco Suárez (1548–1617). Their most important writings were in the areas of metaphysics and philosophy of law. They played a key role in the elaboration of the law of nations (jus gentium) and the theory of just war, a debate that began with Vitoria’s Relectio de iure belli (A Re-lecture of the Right of War, 1539) and continued with the writings of Domingo de Soto (1494–1560), Suárez, and many others. In the field of metaphysics, the most important work is Suárez’ Disputationes metaphysicae (Metaphysical Disputations, 1597), a systematic presentation of philosophy—against the background of Christian principles—that set the standard for philosophical and theological teaching for almost two centuries.

2. Humanism

The humanist movement did not eliminate older approaches to philosophy, but contributed to change them in important ways, providing new information and new methods to the field. Humanists called for a radical change of philosophy and uncovered older texts that multiplied and hardened current philosophical discord. Some of the most salient features of humanist reform are the accurate study of texts in the original languages, the preference for ancient authors and commentators over medieval ones, and the avoidance of technical language in the interest of moral suasion and accessibility. Humanists stressed moral philosophy as the branch of philosophical studies that best met their needs. They addressed a general audience in an accessible manner and aimed to bring about an increase in public and private virtue. Regarding philosophy as a discipline allied to history, rhetoric, and philology, they expressed little interest in metaphysical or epistemological questions. Logic was subordinated to rhetoric and reshaped to serve the purposes of persuasion.

One of the seminal figures of the humanist movement was Francesco Petrarca (1304–1374). In De sui ipsius et multorum aliorum ignorantia (On His Own Ignorance and That of Many Others), he elaborated what was to become the standard critique of Scholastic philosophy. One of his main objections to Scholastic Aristotelianism is that it is useless and ineffective in achieving the good life. Moreover, to cling to a single authority when all authorities are unreliable is simply foolish. He especially attacked, as opponents of Christianity, Aristotle’s commentator Averroes and contemporary Aristotelians that agreed with him. Petrarca returned to a conception of philosophy rooted in the classical tradition, and from his time onward, when professional humanists took interest in philosophy, they nearly always concerned themselves with ethical questions. Among those he influenced were Coluccio Salutati (1331–1406), Leonardo Bruni (c.1370–1444) and Poggio Bracciolini (1380–1459), all of whom promoted humanistic learning in distinctive ways.

One of the most original and important humanists of the Quattrocento was Lorenzo Valla (1406–1457). His most influential writing was Elegantiae linguae Latinae (Elegances of the Latin Language), a handbook of Latin language and style. He is also famous for having demonstrated, on the basis of linguistic and historical evidence, that the so-called Donation of Constantine, on which the secular rule of the papacy was based, was an early medieval forgery. His main philosophical work is Repastinatio dialecticae et philosophiae (Reploughing of Dialectic and Philosophy), an attack on major tenets of Aristotelian philosophy. The first book deals with the criticism of fundamental notions of metaphysics, ethics, and natural philosophy, while the remaining two books are devoted to dialectics.

Throughout the fifteenth and early sixteenth century, humanists were unanimous in their condemnation of university education and their contempt for Scholastic logic. Humanists such as Valla and Rudolph Agricola (1443–1485), whose main work is De inventione dialectica (On Dialectical Invention, 1479), set about to replace the Scholastic curriculum, based on syllogism and disputation, with a treatment of logic oriented toward the use of persuasion and topics, a technique of verbal association aiming at the invention and organization of material for arguments. According to Valla and Agricola, language is primarily a vehicle for communication and debate, and consequently arguments should be evaluated in terms of how effective and useful they are rather than in terms of formal validity. Accordingly, they subsumed the study of the Aristotelian theory of inference under a broader range of forms of argumentation. This approach was taken up and developed in various directions by later humanists, such as Mario Nizolio (1488–1567), Juan Luis Vives (1493–1540), and Petrus Ramus (1515–1572).

Vives was a Spanish-born humanist who spent the greater part of his life in the Low Countries. He aspired to replace the Scholastic tradition in all fields of learning with a humanist curriculum inspired by education in the classics. In 1519, he published In Pseudodialecticos (Against the Pseudodialecticians), a satirical diatribe against Scholastic logic in which he voices his opposition on several counts. A detailed criticism can be found in De disciplinis (On the Disciplines, 1531), an encyclopedic work divided into three parts: De causis corruptarum artium (On the Causes of the Corruption of the Arts), a collection of seven books devoted to a thorough critique of the foundations of contemporary education; De tradendis disciplinis (On Handing Down the Disciplines), five books where Vives’s educational reform is outlined; and De artibus (On the Arts), five shorter treatises that deal mainly with logic and metaphysics. Another area in which Vives enjoyed considerable success was psychology. His reflections on the human soul are mainly concentrated in De anima et vita (On the Soul and Life, 1538), a study of the soul and its interaction with the body, which also contains a penetrating analysis of the emotions.

Ramus was another humanist who criticized the shortcomings of contemporary teaching and advocated a humanist reform of the arts curriculum. His textbooks were the best sellers of their day and were very influential in Protestant universities  in the later sixteenth century. In 1543, he published Dialecticae partitiones (The Structure of Dialectic), which in its second edition was called Dialecticae institutiones (Training in Dialectic), and Aristotelicae animadversions (Remarks on Aristotle). These works gained him a reputation as a virulent opponent of Aristotelian philosophy. He considered his own dialectics, consisting of invention and judgment, to be applicable to all areas of knowledge, and he emphasised the need for learning to be comprehensible and useful, with a particular stress on the practical aspects of mathematics. His own reformed system of logic reached its definitive form with the publication of the third edition of Dialectique (1555).

Humanism also supported Christian reform. The most important Christian humanist was the Dutch scholar Desiderius Erasmus (c.1466–1536). He was hostile to Scholasticism, which he did not consider a proper basis for Christian life, and put his erudition at the service of religion by promoting learned piety (docta pietas). In 1503, he published Enchiridion militis christiani (Handbook of the Christian Soldier), a guide to the Christian life addressed to laymen in need of spiritual guidance, in which he developed the concept of a philosophia Christi. His most famous work is Moriae encomium (The Praise of Folly), a satirical monologue first published in 1511 that touches upon a variety of social, political, intellectual, and religious issues. In 1524, he published De libero arbitrio (On Free Will), an open attack a one central doctrine of Martin Luther’s theology: that the human will is enslaved by sin. Erasmus’s analysis hinges on the interpretation of relevant biblical and patristic passages and reaches the conclusion that the human will is extremely weak, but able, with the help of divine grace, to choose the path of salvation.

Humanism also had an impact of overwhelming importance on the development of political thought. With Institutio principis christiani (The Education of a Christian Prince, 1516), Erasmus contributed to the popular genre of humanist advice books for princes. These manuals dealt with the proper ends of government and how best to attain them. Among humanists of the fourteenth century, the most usual proposal was that a strong monarchy should be the best form of government. Petrarca, in his account of princely government that was written in 1373 and took the form of a letter to Francesco da Carrara, argued that cities ought to be governed by princes who accept their office reluctantly and who pursue glory through virtuous actions. His views were repeated in quite a few of the numerous “mirror for princes” (speculum principis) composed during the course of the fifteenth century, such as Giovanni Pontano’s De principe (On the Prince, 1468) and Bartolomeo Sacchi’s De principe (On the Prince, 1471).

Several authors exploited the tensions within the genre of “mirror for princes” in order to defend popular regimes. In Laudatio florentinae urbis (Panegyric of the City of Florence), Bruni maintained that justice can only be assured by a republican constitution. In his view, cities must be governed according to justice if they are to become glorious, and justice is impossible without liberty.

The most important text to challenge the assumptions of princely humanism, however, was Il principe (The Prince), written by the Florentine Niccolò Machiavelli (1469–1527) in 1513, but not published until 1532. A fundamental belief among the humanists was that a ruler needs to cultivate a number of qualities, such as justice and other moral values, in order to acquire honour, glory, and fame. Machiavelli deviated from this view claiming that justice has no decisive place in politics. It is the ruler’s prerogative to decide when to dispense violence and practice deception, no matter how wicked or immoral, as long as the peace of the city is maintained and his share of glory maximized. Machiavelli did not hold that princely regimes were superior to all others. In his less famous, but equally influential, Discorsi sopra la prima deca di Tito Livio (Discourses on the First Ten Books of Titus Livy, 1531), he offers a defense of popular liberty and republican government that takes the ancient republic of Rome as its model.

3. Platonism

During the Renaissance, it gradually became possible to take a broader view of philosophy than the traditional Peripatetic framework permitted. No ancient revival had more impact on the history of philosophy than the recovery of Platonism. The rich doctrinal content and formal elegance of Platonism made it a plausible competitor of the Peripatetic tradition. Renaissance Platonism was a product of humanism and marked a sharper break with medieval philosophy. Many Christians found Platonic philosophy safer and more attractive than Aristotelianism. The Neoplatonic conception of philosophy as a way toward union with God supplied many Renaissance Platonists with some of their richest inspiration. The Platonic dialogues were not seen as profane texts to be understood literally, but as sacred mysteries to be deciphered.

Platonism was brought to Italy by the Byzantine scholar George Gemistos Plethon (c.1360–1454), who, during the Council of Florence in 1439, gave a series of lectures that he later reshaped as De differentiis Aristotelis et Platonis (The Differences between Aristotle and Plato). This work, which compared the doctrines of the two philosophers (to Aristotle’s great disadvantage), initiated a controversy regarding the relative superiority of Plato and Aristotle. In the treatise In calumniatorem Platonis (Against the Calumniator of Plato), Cardinal Bessarion (1403–1472) defended Plethon against the charge levelled against his philosophy by the Aristotelian George of Trebizond (1396–1472), who in Comparatio philosophorum Aristotelis et Platonis (A Comparison of the Philosophers Aristotle and Plato) had maintained that Platonism was unchristian and actually a new religion.

The most important Renaissance Platonist was Marsilio Ficino (1433–1499), who translated Plato’s works into Latin and wrote commentaries on several of them. He also translated and commented on Plotinus’s Enneads and translated treatises and commentaries by Porphyry, Iamblichus, Proclus, Synesius, and other Neoplatonists. He considered Plato as part of a long tradition of ancient theology (prisca theologia) that was inaugurated by Hermes and Zoroaster, culminated with Plato, and continued with Plotinus and the other Neoplatonists. Like the ancient Neoplatonists, Ficino assimilated Aristotelian physics and metaphysics and adapted them to Platonic purposes. In his main philosophical treatise, Theologia Platonica de immortalitate animorum (Platonic Theology on the Immortality of Souls, 1482), he put forward his synthesis of Platonism and Christianity as a new theology and metaphysics, which, unlike that of many Scholastics, was explicitly opposed to Averroist secularism. Another work that became very popular was De vita libri tres (Three Books on Life, 1489) by Ficino; it deals with the health of professional scholars and presents a philosophical theory of natural magic.

One of Ficino’s most distinguished associates was Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463–1494). He is best known as the author of the celebrated Oratio de hominis dignitate (Oration on the Dignity of Man), which is often regarded as the manifesto of the new Renaissance thinking, but he also wrote several other prominent works. They include Disputationes adversus astrologiam divinatricem (Disputations against Divinatory Astrology), an influential diatribe against astrology; De ente et uno (On Being and the One), a short treatise attempting to reconcile Platonic and Aristotelian metaphysical views; as well as Heptaplus (Seven Days of Creation), a mystical interpretation of the Genesis creation myth. He was not a devout Neoplatonist like Ficino, but rather an Aristotelian by training and in many ways an eclectic by conviction. He wanted to combine Greek, Hebrew, Muslim, and Christian thought into a great synthesis, which he spelled out in nine hundred theses published as Conclusiones in 1486. He planned to defend them publicly in Rome, but three were found heretical and ten others suspect. He defended them in Apologia, which provoked the condemnation of the whole work by Pope Innocent VIII. Pico’s consistent aim in his writings was to exalt the powers of human nature. To this end he defended the use of magic, which he described as the noblest part of natural science, and Kabbalah, a Jewish form of mysticism that was probably of Neoplatonic origin.

Platonic themes were also central to the thought of Nicholas of Cusa (1401–1464), who linked his philosophical activity to the Neoplatonic tradition and authors such as Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius. The main problem that runs through his works is how humans, as finite created beings, can think about the infinite and transcendent God. His best-known work is De docta ignorantia (On Learned Ignorance, 1440), which gives expression to his view that the human mind needs to realize its own necessary ignorance of what God is like, an ignorance that results from the ontological and cognitive disproportion between God and the finite human knower. Correlated to the doctrine of learned ignorance is that of the coincidence of opposites in God. All things coincide in God in the sense that God, as undifferentiated being, is beyond all opposition. Two other works that are closely connected to De docta ignorantia are De coniecturis (On Conjectures), in which he denies the possibility of exact knowledge, maintaining that all human knowledge is conjectural, and Apologia docta ignorantiae (A Defense of Learned Ignorance, 1449). In the latter, he makes clear that the doctrine of learned ignorance is not intended to deny knowledge of the existence of God, but only to deny all knowledge of God’s nature.

One of the most serious obstacles to the reception and adoption of Platonism in the early fifteenth century was the theory of Platonic love. Many scholars were simply unable to accept Plato’s explicit treatment of homosexuality. Yet by the middle of the sixteenth century this doctrine had become one of the most popular elements of Platonic philosophy. The transformation of Platonic love from an immoral and offensive liability into a valuable asset represents an important episode in the history of Plato’s re-emergence during the Renaissance as a major influence on Western thought.

Bessarion and Ficino did not deny that Platonic love was essentially homosexual in outlook, but they insisted that it was entirely honourable and chaste. To reinforce this point, they associated Platonic discussions of love with those found in the Bible. Another way in which Ficino made Platonic love more palatable to his contemporaries was to emphasise its place within an elaborate system of Neoplatonic metaphysics. But Ficino’s efforts to accommodate the theory to the values of a fifteenth-century audience did not include concealing or denying that Platonic love was homoerotic. Ficino completely accepted the idea that Platonic love involved a chaste relationship between men and endorsed the belief that the soul’s spiritual ascent to ultimate beauty was fuelled by love between men.

In Gli Asolani (1505), the humanist Pietro Bembo (1470–1547) appropriated the language of Platonic love to describe some aspects of the romance between a man and a woman. In this work, love was presented as unequivocally heterosexual. Most of the ideas set out by Ficino are echoed by Bembo. However, Ficino had separated physical love, which had women as its object, from spiritual love, which was shared between men. Bembo’s version of Platonic love, on the other hand, dealt with the relationship between a man and a woman which gradually progresses from a sexual to a spiritual level. The view of Platonic love formulated by Bembo reached its largest audience with the humanist Baldesar Castiglione’s (1478–1529) Il libro del cortegiano (The Courtier, 1528). Castiglione carried on the trend, initiated by Bessarion, of giving Platonic love a strongly religious coloring, and most of the philosophical content is taken from Ficino.

One of the most popular Renaissance treatises on love, Dialoghi d’amore (Dialogues of Love, 1535), was written by the Jewish philosopher Judah ben Isaac Abravanel, also known as Leone Ebreo (c.1460/5–c.1520/5). The work consists of three conversations on love, which he conceives of as the animating principle of the universe and the cause of all existence, divine as well as material. The first dialogue discusses the relation between love and desire; the second the universality of love; and the third, which provides the longest and most sustained philosophical discussion, the origin of love. He draws upon Platonic and Neoplatonic sources, as well as on the cosmology and metaphysics of Jewish and Arabic thinkers, which are combined with Aristotelian sources in order to produce a synthesis of Aristotelian and Platonic views.

4. Hellenistic Philosophies

Stoicism, Epicureanism, and Skepticism underwent a revival over the course of the fifteenth and sixteenth centuries as part of the ongoing recovery of ancient literature and thought. The revival of Stoicism began with Petrarca, whose renewal of Stoicism moved along two paths. The first one was inspired by Seneca and consisted in the presentation, in works such as De vita solitaria (The Life of Solitude) and De otio religioso (On Religious Leisure), of a way of life in which the cultivation of the scholarly work and ethical perfection are one. The second was his elaboration of Stoic therapy against emotional distress in De secreto conflictu curarum mearum (On the Secret Conflict of My Worries), an inner dialogue of the sort prescribed by Cicero and Seneca, and in De remediis utriusque fortunae (Remedies for Good and Bad Fortune, 1366), a huge compendium based on a short apocryphal tract attributed at the time to Seneca.

While many humanists shared Petrarca’s esteem for Stoic moral philosophy, others called its stern prescriptions into question. They accused the Stoics of suppressing all emotions and criticized their view for its inhuman rigidity. In contrast to the extreme ethical stance of the Stoics, they preferred the more moderate Peripatetic position, arguing that it provides a more realistic basis for morality, since it places the acquisition of virtue within the reach of normal human capacities. Another Stoic doctrine that was often criticized on religious grounds was the conviction that the wise man is entirely responsible for his own happiness and has no need of divine assistance.

The most important exponent of Stoicism during the Renaissance was the Flemish humanist Justus Lipsius (1547–1606), who worked hard to brighten the appeal of Stoicism to Christians. His first Neostoic work was De constantia (On Constancy, 1584), in which he promoted Stoic moral philosophy as a refuge from the horrors of the civil and religious wars that ravaged the continent at the time. His main accounts of Stoicism were Physiologia Stoicorum (Physical Theory of the Stoics) and Manuductio ad stoicam philosophiam (Guide to Stoic Philosophy), both published in 1604. Together they constituted the most learned account of Stoic philosophy produced since antiquity.

During the Middle Ages, Epicureanism was associated with contemptible atheism and hedonist dissipation. In 1417, Bracciolini found Lucretius’s poem De rerum natura, the most informative source on Epicurean teaching, which, together with Ambrogio Traversari’s translation of Diogenes Laertius’s Life of Epicurus into Latin, contributed to a more discriminating appraisal of Epicurean doctrine and a repudiation of the traditional prejudice against the person of Epicurus himself. In a letter written in 1428, Francesco Filelfo (1398–1481) insisted that, contrary to popular opinion, Epicurus was not “addicted to pleasure, lewd and lascivious,” but rather “sober, learned and venerable.” In the epistolary treatise Defensio Epicuri contra Stoicos, Academicos et Peripateticos (Defense of Epicurus against Stoics, Academics and Peripatetics), Cosma Raimondi (d. 1436) vigorously defended Epicurus and the view that the supreme good consists in pleasure both of the mind and the body. He argued that pleasure, according to Epicurus, is not opposed to virtue, but both guided and produced by it. Some humanists tried to harmonize Epicurean with Christian doctrine. In his dialogue De voluptate (On Pleasure, 1431), which was two years later reworked as De vero falsoque bono (On the True and False Good), Valla examined Stoic, Epicurean, and Christian conceptions of the true good. To the ultimate good of the Stoics, that is, virtue practiced for its own sake, Valla opposed that of the Epicureans, represented by pleasure, on the grounds that pleasure comes closer to Christian happiness, which is superior to either pagan ideal.

The revival of ancient philosophy was particularly dramatic in the case of Skepticism, whose revitalisation grew out of many of the currents of Renaissance thought and contributed to make the problem of knowledge crucial for early modern philosophy. The major ancient texts stating the Skeptical arguments were slightly known in the Middle Ages. It was in the fifteenth and sixteenth century that Sextus Empiricus’s Outlines of Pyrrhonism and Against the Mathematicians, Cicero’s Academica, and Diogenes Laertius’s Life of Pyrrho started to receive serious philosophical consideration.

The most significant and influential figure in the development of Renaissance Skepticism is Michel de Montaigne (1533–1592). The most thorough presentation of his Skeptical views occurs in Apologie de Raimond Sebond (Apology for Raymond Sebond), the longest and most philosophical of his essays. In it, he developed in a gradual manner the many kinds of problems that make people doubt the reliability of human reason. He considered in detail the ancient Skeptical arguments about the unreliability of information gained by the senses or by reason, about the inability of human beings to find a satisfactory criterion of knowledge, and about the relativity of moral opinions. He concluded that people should suspend judgment on all matters and follow customs and traditions. He combined these conclusions with fideism.

Many Renaissance appropriators of Academic and Pyrrhonian Skeptical arguments did not see any intrinsic value in Skepticism, but rather used it to attack Aristotelianism and disparage the claims of human science. They challenged the intellectual foundations of medieval Scholastic learning by raising serious questions about the nature of truth and about the ability of humans to discover it. In Examen vanitatis doctrinae gentium et veritatis Christianae disciplinae (Examination of the Vanity of Pagan Doctrine and of the Truth of Christian Teaching, 1520), Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola (1469–1533) set out to prove the futility of pagan doctrine and the truth of Christianity. He regarded Skepticism as ideally suited to his campaign, since it challenged the possibility of attaining certain knowledge by means of the senses or by reason, but left the scriptures, grounded in divine revelation, untouched. In the first part of the work, he used the Skeptical arguments contained in the works of Sextus Empiricus against the various schools of ancient philosophy; and in the second part he turned Skepticism against Aristotle and the Peripatetic tradition. His aim was not to call everything into doubt, but rather to discredit every source of knowledge except scripture and condemn all attempts to find truth elsewhere as vain.

In a similar way, Agrippa von Nettesheim (1486–1535), whose real name was Heinrich Cornelius, demonstrated in De incertitudine et vanitate scientiarum atque artium (On the Uncertainty and Vanity of the Arts and Sciences, 1530) the contradictions of scientific doctrines. With stylistic brilliance, he described the controversies of the established academic community and dismissed all academic endeavors in view of the finitude of human experience, which in his view comes to rest only in faith.

The fame of the Portuguese philosopher and medical writer Francisco Sanches (1551–1623) rests mainly on Quod nihil scitur (That Nothing Is Known, 1581), one of the best systematic expositions of philosophical Skepticism produced during the sixteenth century. The treatise contains a radical criticism of the Aristotelian notion of science, but beside its critical aim, it had a constructive objective, which posterity has tended to neglect, consisting in Sanches’s quest for a new method of philosophical and scientific inquiry that could be universally applied. This method was supposed to be expounded in another book that was either lost, remained unpublished, or was not written at all.

5. New Philosophies of Nature

In 1543, Nicolaus Copernicus (1473–1543) published De revolutionibus orbium coelestium (On the Revolutions of the Heavenly Spheres), which proposed a new calculus of planetary motion based on several new hypotheses, such as heliocentrism and the motion of the earth. The first generation of readers underestimated the revolutionary character of the work and regarded the hypotheses of the work only as useful mathematical fictions. The result was that astronomers appreciated and adopted some of Copernicus’s mathematical models but rejected his cosmology. Yet, the Aristotelian representation of the universe did not remain unchallenged and new visions of nature, its principles, and its mode of operation started to emerge.

During the sixteenth century, there were many philosophers of nature who felt that Aristotle’s system could no longer regulate honest inquiry into nature. Therefore, they stopped trying to adjust the Aristotelian system and turned their backs on it altogether. It is hard to imagine how early modern philosophers, such as Francis Bacon (1561–1626), Pierre Gassendi (1592–1655,) and René Descartes (1596–1650), could have cleared the ground for the scientific revolution without the work of novatores such as Bernardino Telesio (1509–1588), Francesco Patrizi (1529–1597), Giordano Bruno (1548–1600), and Tommaso Campanella (1568–1639).

Telesio grounded his system on a form of empiricism, which maintained that nature can only be understood through sense perception and empirical research. In 1586, two years before his death, he published the definitive version of his work De rerum natura iuxta propria principia (On the Nature of Things according to their Own Principles). The book is a frontal assault on the foundations of Peripatetic philosophy, accompanied by a proposal for replacing Aristotelianism with a system more faithful to nature and experience. According to Telesio, the only things that must be presupposed are passive matter and the two principles of heat and cold, which are in perpetual struggle to occupy matter and exclude their opposite. These principles were meant to replace the Aristotelian metaphysical principles of matter and form. Some of Telesio’s innovations were seen as theologically dangerous and his philosophy became the object of vigorous attacks. De rerum natura iuxta propria principia was included on the Index of Prohibited Books published in Rome in 1596.

Through the reading of Telesio’s work, Campanella developed a profound distaste for Aristotelian philosophy and embraced the idea that nature should be explained through its own principles. He rejected the fundamental Aristotelian principle of hylomorphism and adopted instead Telesio’s understanding of reality in terms of the principles of matter, heat, and cold, which he combined with Neoplatonic ideas derived from Ficino. His first published work was Philosophia sensibus demonstrata (Philosophy as Demonstrated by the Senses, 1591), an anti-Peripatetic polemic in defense of Telesio’s system of natural philosophy. Thereafter, he was censured, tortured, and repeatedly imprisoned for his heresies. During the years of his incarceration, he composed many of his most famous works, such as De sensu rerum et magia (On the Sense of Things and On Magic, 1620), which sets out his vision of the natural world as a living organism and displays his keen interest in natural magic; Ateismus triomphatus (Atheism Conquered), a polemic against both reason of state and Machiavelli’s conception of religion as a political invention; and Apologia pro Galileo (Defense of Galileo), a defense of the freedom of thought (libertas philosophandi) of Galileo and of Christian scientists in general. Campanella’s most ambitious work is Metaphysica (1638), which constitutes the most comprehensive presentation of his philosophy and whose aim is to produce a new foundation for the entire encyclopedia of knowledge. His most celebrated work is the utopian treatise La città del sole (The City of the Sun), which describes an ideal model of society that, in contrast to the violence and disorder of the real world, is in harmony with nature.

In contrast to Telesio, who was a fervent critic of metaphysics and insisted on a purely empiricist approach in natural philosophy, Patrizi developed a program in which natural philosophy and cosmology were connected with their metaphysical and theological foundations. His Discussiones peripateticae (Peripatetic Discussions) provides a close comparison of the views of Aristotle and Plato on a wide range of philosophical issues, arguing that Plato’s views are preferable on all counts. Inspired by such Platonic predecessors as Proclus and Ficino, Patrizi elaborated his own philosophical system in Nova de universalis philosophia (The New Universal Philosophy, 1591), which is divided in four parts: Panaugia, Panarchia, Pampsychia, and Pancosmia. He saw light as the basic metaphysical principle and interpreted the universe in terms of the diffusion of light. The fourth and last part of the work, in which he expounded his cosmology showing how the physical world derives its existence from God, is by far the most original and important. In it, he replaced the four Aristotelian elements with his own alternatives: space, light, heat, and humidity. Gassendi and Henry More (1614–1687) adopted his concept of space, which indirectly came to influence Newton.

A more radical cosmology was proposed by Bruno, who was an extremely prolific writer. His most significant works include those on the art of memory and the combinatory method of Ramon Llull, as well as the moral dialogues Spaccio de la bestia trionfante (The Expulsion of the Triumphant Beast, 1584), Cabala del cavallo pegaseo (The Kabbalah of the Pegasean Horse, 1585) and De gl’heroici furori (The Heroic Frenzies, 1585). Much of his fame rests on three cosmological dialogues published in 1584: La cena de le ceneri (The Ash Wednesday Supper), De la causa, principio et uno (On the Cause, the Principle and the One) and De l’infinito, universo et mondi (On the Infinite, the Universe and the Worlds). In these, with inspiration from Lucretius, the Neoplatonists, and, above all, Nicholas of Cusa, he elaborates a coherent and strongly articulated ontological monism. Individual beings are conceived as accidents or modes of a unique substance, that is, the universe, which he describes as an animate and infinitely extended unity containing innumerable worlds. Bruno adhered to Copernicus’s cosmology but transformed it, postulating an infinite universe. Although an infinite universe was by no means his invention, he was the first to locate a heliocentric system in infinite space. In 1600, he was burned at the stake by the Inquisition for his heretical teachings.

Even though these new philosophies of nature anticipated some of the defining features of early modern thought, many of their methodological characteristics appeared to be inadequate in the face of new scientific developments. The methodology of Galileo Galilei (1564–1642) and of the other pioneers of the new science was essentially mathematical. Moreover, the development of the new science took place by means of methodical observations and experiments, such as Galileo’s telescopic discoveries and his experiments on inclined planes. The critique of Aristotle’s teaching formulated by natural philosophers such as Telesio, Campanella, Patrizi, and Bruno undoubtedly helped to weaken it, but it was the new philosophy of the early seventeenth century that sealed the fate of the Aristotelian worldview and set the tone for a new age.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Allen, M. J. B., & Rees, V., eds., Marsilio Ficino: His Theology, his Philosophy, his Legacy (Leiden: Brill, 2002).
  • Bellitto, C., & al., eds., Introducing Nicholas of Cusa: A Guide to a Renaissance Man (New York: Paulist Press, 2004).
  • Bianchi, L., Studi sull’aristotelismo del Rinascimento (Padua: Il Poligrafo, 2003).
  • Blum, P. R., ed., Philosophers of the Renaissance (Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press, 2010).
  • Copenhaver, B. P., & Schmitt, C. B., Renaissance Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992).
  • Damiens, S., Amour et Intellect chez Leon l’Hébreu (Toulouse: Edouard Privat Editeur, 1971).
  • Dougherty, M. V., ed., Pico della Mirandola: New Essays (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008).
  • Ernst, G., Tommaso Campanella: The Book and the Body of Nature, transl. D. Marshall (Dordrecht: Springer, 2010).
  • Fantazzi, C., ed., A Companion to Juan Luis Vives (Leiden: Brill, 2008).
  • Gatti, H., ed., Giordano Bruno: Philosopher of the Renaissance (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2002).
  • Granada, M. A., La reivindicación de la filosofía en Giordano Bruno (Barcelona: Herder, 2005).
  • Guerlac, R., Juan Luis Vives against the Pseudodialecticians: A Humanist Attack on Medieval Logic (Dordrecht: Reidel, 1979).
  • Hankins, J., Plato in the Italian Renaissance, 2 vols. (Leiden: Brill, 1990).
  • Hankins, J., Humanism and Platonism in the Italian Renaissance, 2 vols. (Rome: Edizioni di storia e letteratura, 2003–4).
  • Hankins, J., ed., The Cambridge Companion to Renaissance Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007).
  • Headley, J. M., Tommaso Campanella and the Transformation of the World (Princeton, N.J.: Princeton University Press, 1997).
  • Kraye, J., Classical Traditions in Renaissance Philosophy (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2002).
  • Mack, P., Renaissance Argument: Valla and Agricola in the Traditions of Rhetoric and Dialectic (Leiden: Brill, 1993).
  • Mahoney, E. P., Two Aristotelians of the Italian Renaissance: Nicoletto Vernia and Agostino Nifo (Aldershot: Ashgate, 2000).
  • Mikkeli, H., An Aristotelian Response to Renaissance Humanism: Jacopo Zabarella on the Nature of Arts and Sciences (Helsinki: Societas Historica Finlandiae, 1992).
  • Nauert, C. A., Agrippa and the Crisis of Renaissance Thought (Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 1965).
  • Nauta, L., In Defense of Common Sense: Lorenzo Valla’s Humanist Critique of Scholastic Philosophy (Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press, 2009).
  • Noreña, C. G., Juan Luis Vives (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1970).
  • Ong, W. J., Ramus: Method and the Decay of Dialogue (Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press).
  • Paganini, G., & Maia Neto, J. R., eds., Renaissance Scepticisms (Dordrecht: Springer, 2009).
  • Pine, M. L., Pietro Pomponazzi: Radical Philosopher of the Renaissance (Padova: Antenore, 1986).
  • Popkin, R. H., The History of Scepticism from Savonarola to Bayle (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003).
  • Rummel, E., The Humanist-Scholastic Debate in the Renaissance and Reformation (Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press, 1995).
  • Schmitt, C. B., Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola (1469–1533) and His Critique of Aristotle (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1967).
  • Schmitt, C. B., Cicero Scepticus: A Study of the Influence of the Academica in the Renaissance (The Hague: Nijhoff, 1972).
  • Schmitt, C. B., Aristotle and the Renaissance (Cambridge, MA.: Harvard University Press, 1983).
  • Schmitt, C. B., & al., eds., The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988).
  • Skinner, Q., The Foundations of Modern Political Thought, vol. 1, The Renaissance (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1978).
  • Yates, F. A., Giordano Bruno and the Hermetic Tradition (London: Rouledge & Kegan Paul, 1964).

Author Information

Lorenzo Casini
Uppsala University

Marsilio Ficino (1433-1499)

FicinoMarsilio Ficino was a Florentine philosopher, translator, and commentator, largely responsible for the revival of Plato and Platonism in the Renaissance. He has been widely recognized by historians of philosophy for his defense of the immortality of the soul, as well as for his translations of Plato, Plotinus, and the Hermetic corpus from Greek to Latin. Ficino is considered the most important advocate of Platonism in the Renaissance, and his philosophical writings and translations are thought to have made a significant contribution to the development of early modern philosophies.

The Platonic Theology is Ficino’s most original and systematic philosophical treatise. It is a lengthy and encyclopedic defense of the immortality of the soul against what he considered the growing threats of Epicureanism and Averroism. While arguing for immortality, Ficino articulates those positions that are most characteristic of his philosophy. He first provides his own restructuring of the Neoplatonic hierarchy of being. This metaphysical structure is used to ensure the dignity and immortality of the soul by situating it at a privileged midpoint between God and prime matter. However, this hierarchy also has negative consequences for the qualitative character of human existence on account of the soul’s proximity to matter. Finally, the Platonic Theology lays down the basic principles of Ficino’s animistic natural philosophy, according to which a World Soul is imminent in the material world, imparting motion, life, and order.

In addition to the Platonic Theology, Ficino also composed extensive commentaries on Plato and Plotinus, wrote a practical medical treatise, and carried on a voluminous correspondence with contemporaries across Europe. There are noteworthy elements in his writings that are less traditional and orthodox by some contemporary philosophical standards. For example, he was deeply influenced by the Hermetic tradition, and describes a species of knowledge, or natural magic, that draws down the intellectual and moral virtues of the heavens to the terrestrial world. Ficino also endorses an ancient theological tradition that included, to name a few, Hermes Trismegistus, Pythagoras, and Orpheus among its ranks. He held that this pagan tradition espoused a pious philosophy that in fact presaged and confirmed Christianity.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. The Platonic Academy of Florence
  3. The Ancient Theology and Pious Philosophy
  4. Platonic Theology
    1. Metaphysics
    2. Epistemology
    3. The Dignity of Humanity and the Human Condition
    4. The Immortality of the Soul
  5. Ethics and Love
  6. Legacy
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Marsilio Ficino was born in Figline, not far from Florence, in 1433. He was the son of a physician, and Cosimo de’Medici—one of the richest and most powerful patrons of the fifteenth century—was among his father’s patients. While the precise details of his early life and education remain largely unclear to us today, it can safely be said that he studied Scholastic philosophy and medicine at the University of Florence, and that he was exposed to the burgeoning educational movement of Italian Humanism. Ficino’s earliest philosophical writings are largely Scholastic in their consideration of metaphysical, logical, and natural philosophical questions. In particular, Thomas Aquinas had a strong influence on significant aspects of his early thought, and this influence is thought to have persisted in his later philosophical writings.

The biographical contours of Ficino’s early life become clearer in the 1450s. He lectured on Plato’s Philebus; he also taught for a short time at the university in Florence, and privately as a tutor. As a young man Ficino fell under the influence of the Roman poet Lucretius. A manuscript copy of his didactic Epicurean poem, On the Nature of Things, was rediscovered in a monastery in 1417. After its recovery the poem was copied, disseminated, and eventually found its way into print and vernacular languages. Ficino was among the first generation of philosophers with direct access to the actual text of On the Nature of Things, which is thought to have played an important role in the development of early modern philosophy and science. During the late 1450s, Ficino composed a short commentary on Lucretius, the first since antiquity, as well as a treatise on pleasure. In this treatise he praises the Epicurean definition of pleasure as the removal of pain from the body and disturbance from the soul, and argues that Epicureanism is superior to the vulgar hedonism of someone like Aristippus. Ficino suggests that he experienced an intellectual or spiritual crisis during this time, and as a result ultimately rejected Epicurus and Lucretius as incompatible with deeply held philosophical and religious commitments. In a letter, Ficino reports that he burned his youthful commentary on Lucretius. Despite this Epicurus and Lucretius left an enduring stamp on Ficino’s thought that is visible in the mature philosophical writings, and historians of Renaissance philosophy are still assessing this influence today.

During the 1450s Ficino began to study Greek. In time, his knowledge of classical Greek culminated in one of his most lasting philosophical and scholarly achievements and contributions—his translation of Plato’s complete works into Latin. In 1462, Cosimo de’Medici commissioned Ficino to translate a manuscript copy of Plato’s extant writings. Around the same time, Cosimo also gave him the proceeds from a small property, as well as a villa in Careggi, not far from Florence. The conditions of the 1460s provided Ficino with the perfect opportunity to fully dedicate himself to translating Plato’s complete writings into Latin. His edition marked the first time that Plato’s extant corpus was translated into a Western language. Ficino’s work on Plato, however, was quickly interrupted when Cosimo requested that he also translate the Corpus Hermeticum into Latin. At the time, the Hermetic corpus was believed by many to be an ancient collection of theological writings that contained sacred wisdom. It was, however, written in the early years of Christianity. In 1464, Ficino read his translations of Plato’s dialogues to Cosimo as the aging patron lay dying.

In the late 1460s, after completing his translation of Plato, Ficino started working on his Platonic Theology: On the Immortality of the Soul. This book was finished in 1474, but it did not find its way into print until 1482. The Platonic Theology is Ficino’s longest and most systematic philosophical work. In 1473, he was ordained a priest, and after completing his Platonic Theology, dedicated himself primarily to translation, commentary, and correspondence. During this time Ficino also wrote the bulk of his commentaries on Plato’s dialogues. The last two decades of Ficino’s life were especially productive. In the 1480s, he translated the Enneads of the second-century Neoplatonist Plotinus, and also wrote commentaries on them. An edition of Plotinus was published in 1492. During this time Ficino completed his Three Books on Life, a medical and astrological treatise. After its 1489 publication it became one of his most popular and influential books. The third book presents Ficino’s theory of natural magic, which has since become the definitive Renaissance consideration of the subject.

Throughout his life Ficino carried on a steady correspondence with philosophers, poets, and politicians across Europe. This choice of philosophical expression shows the influence that Humanism had on him. In many letters, Ficino clarifies his understanding of certain Platonic concepts, such as poetic furor; but on a whole his correspondence is not strictly philosophical in nature, at least not by academic standards today. Even so, it contains information that is central to an accurate appreciation of his thought. Ficino conceived of philosophy as a way of life that purified and prepared those who practice it correctly for a life well lived. Ficino’s correspondence contains a good deal of practical advice, and he is often found giving counsel on how to cope with the deaths of children, spouses, and friends, or on how to extend one’s life; he also lends sundry medical advice, and even discusses the astrological placement of planets that contribute to one’s character traits. The letters serve both to clarify the content of his philosophy, as well as to shed a different light on what he perceived his role to be as a philosopher and an advocate of Platonism. These sources teach us that Ficino did not define philosophy narrowly. Instead, he saw himself as a doctor of sorts that was concerned with questions that concerned the health of bodies, minds, and souls. This practical concern is clearly displayed in his correspondence, and his Three Books on Life. Ficino edited and published his correspondence in 1494. He died in 1499.

2. The Platonic Academy of Florence

In the fourteenth century, the poet and Humanist Francesco Petrarch praised Plato as the prince of philosophers. In so doing, Petrarch turned to Plato as an antidote to Scholastic Aristotelianism, which at the time dominated the medieval university curriculum. During the Middle Ages the bulk of Plato’s dialogues—except for the Phaedo, Meno, and parts of the Parmenides and Timaeus—were inaccessible to Western philosophers because they were not available in Latin. Consequently, knowledge of Plato’s philosophy at this time was largely indirect and incomplete. Following Petrarch’s lead, early fifteenth-century Humanists (such as Leonardo Bruni) saw the importance of studying classical Greek, and they translated, among other things, a handful of Plato’s dialogues into Latin.

Ficino’s translation represents the fulfillment of these early Humanist aspirations for a Latin edition of Plato. It is difficult to overstate the significance of this achievement, or the impact that it had on the development of early modern philosophies. His Latin translation of Plato enriched the sources available to philosophers in the West, and thereby changed the form and content of philosophy. Ficino largely finished his translation of Plato’s complete works in the 1460s, but they did not appear in print until 1484. The first edition included Ficino’s short descriptions or summaries of what he considered the key arguments of the dialogues; a 1494 edition was expanded to include his lengthy commentaries on Plato’s Symposium, Philebus, Phaedrus, Timaeus, Parmenides, Sophist, and Republic Book VIII. Eventually Ficino’s commentary on the Symposium—an unorthodox dialogue itself loosely inspired by the original—became one of his most popular and influential treatments of Plato. In it he identified Plato’s theory of love with Christian love, and argued that the proper love of another person is in fact preparation for the love of God. He invented the phrase Platonic love, and his interpretation was especially influential in the sixteenth century. His Timaeus commentary is significant because it represents the first consideration of the dialogue in its entirety since antiquity; medieval philosophers only had access to roughly half of the dialogue, and Calcidius’ commentary was necessarily truncated. Ficino’s translations of Plato’s complete works went through many printings and were used by philosophers and scholars for centuries. They continue to be recognized for their precision and fidelity to the original Greek.

Through his translations and commentaries, as well as his Platonic Theology, Ficino played a central role in the Renaissance revival of Platonism. In the second half of the fifteenth century, he stood at the center of a group of intellectuals that were drawn specifically to Plato and Platonism, and more generally to classical antiquity. As a result of his advocacy, historians of Renaissance philosophy for a long time thought that Ficino founded and headed a formal Platonic Academy in Florence that was inspired by Plato’s school in ancient Athens. However, the precise nature of Florence’s Academy remains unclear today, and some are skeptical that any such academy ever really existed. It seems unlikely that Ficino headed a formal educational institution in any real sense. More plausible is the hypothesis that Ficino’s occasional reference to the revival of Plato’s academy in Florence actually designated the presence of a manuscript copy of Plato’s dialogues in Florence, to Plato’s teachings and philosophy, and his own efforts to revive Plato in Florence through his translations and commentaries. Whether or not Ficino actually headed a Platonic Academy in Florence, he was nonetheless instrumental as an advocate of Platonism during the Renaissance.

3. The Ancient Theology and Pious Philosophy

Ficino’s philosophy is indebted to a wide variety of philosophical sources and traditions. Although his thought is eclectic, he does not generally seek to bring distinct and apparently incompatible views into accord or harmony with one another. His work is generally a blend of traditional philosophies, both ancient and medieval, and ideas that are drawn from the less-orthodox Neoplatonic and Hermetic traditions. The influences of Platonism, Neoplatonism, and Scholasticism are particularly prominent.

Like many of his contemporaries, Ficino believed that Hermes Trismegistus was an ancient Egyptian theologian and philosopher of sacred and divine wisdom. In the preface to his translation of the Corpus Hermeticum, Ficino explains that Hermes “foresaw the ruin of the old religion, the rise of the new faith, [and] the coming of Christ.”  In fact, Ficino believed in a single ancient theological tradition (prisca theologia) that stretched back to Hermes in ancient Egypt and included Pythagoras, Orpheus, Philolaus, and Plato, to name a few, among its ranks. This ancient tradition, he argues, espoused a pious philosophy (pia philosophia) in which religious and philosophical truths coincide. The advent of Christianity brought about the fullest and clearest expression of this pious philosophy, though vestiges of it can be found much earlier. Over the course of the history of philosophy, according to Ficino, the fortune of the pious philosophy has waxed and waned, and there are periods during which it is hardly present at all. He considered Plato an especially effective advocate of the pious philosophy; in the preface to the Platonic Theology, he explains that no matter what subject Plato discusses “he quickly brings it round, and in a spirit of utmost piety, to the contemplation and worship of God.”

4. Platonic Theology

The Platonic Theology is Marsilio Ficino’s philosophical magnum opus. Its overall aim is to defend the immortality of the soul, and to this end Ficino avails himself of a wide variety of arguments. For Ficino, this question is at the heart of human self-interest and well-being. In the first chapter, he argues that if human beings were merely mortal, then there would be “no animal more miserable than man.”  Ficino’s core argument is that the natural human desire for immortality must be vindicated by an afterlife. Were it not, this desire would be empty, vain, and this would call into question both the perfection of nature and God’s wisdom and goodness.

While arguing for the soul’s immortality Ficino elaborates on many of those positions and arguments that are distinctive of his philosophy. He presents and defends the basic principles of his metaphysics. While he is deeply indebted to earlier metaphysical traditions, especially the Neoplatonic and Scholastic traditions, elements of these traditions are generally adapted to his own philosophical aims and purposes. Ficino also presents his case for the inherent dignity of humanity. This defense depends in large part on his own restructuring of the Neoplatonic hierarchy of being, according to which the soul is located centrally between God and matter. The soul’s metaphysical position also ensures its immortality. Ficino argues that the soul’s troubled psychological condition is an unfortunate side effect of this hierarchy. He detects a disconnect between the soul’s divinity and the sundry demands and problems that the body causes for it. While the soul is immortal and occupied a privileged place on the great chain of being, its psychological condition is one of exile, longing, and confusion regarding its own nature. Finally, Ficino argues for his vitalistic natural philosophy according to which matter requires the presence of something incorporeal—namely soul—for it to be substantial and real.

The Platonic Theology is a rich and challenging book. Its structure and content may produce confusion and frustration in some contemporary readers. There is an overarching logical structure to the book, but Ficino chooses not to clearly state many of his central assumptions and themes, and the route he takes to his conclusions can often appear circuitous. Ficino frequently utilizes metaphysical and epistemological assumptions, but he does not in every case define or defend them. This is not to say, however, that his views are merely asserted or that his reasoning is flawed in some significant way. Many of his assumptions are generally embedded in earlier philosophical traditions, and thus his views and arguments have to be placed in the proper historical context in order to be appreciated for their rigor and coherence. Ficino thought that philosophy done properly required an ongoing conversation with ancient philosophies. A familiarity with earlier philosophies is therefore necessary in order to fully appreciate and assess the arguments of the Platonic Theology.

a. Metaphysics

Ficino’s metaphysics is a blend of elements drawn from Platonism, Neoplatonism, and medieval Scholasticism. Broadly speaking, he maintains a Platonic division between the intelligible and sensible realms or between being and becoming. Throughout the Platonic Theology, he is found employing the hylomorphic terminology of the Scholastics in his detailed analysis of the nature of things. Ficino embraces and uses the metaphysical hierarchy developed by the Neoplatonist Plotinus, according to which the progressive levels of being emanate from a single source.

In the preface, Ficino explains that a central aim of the Platonic Theology is to demonstrate to materialist philosophers that matter is less real than those incorporeal entities (such as souls and forms) that transcend the senses. To accomplish this aim Ficino relies primarily on Plato’s dialogues, because in his estimation they most successfully demote the reality of the material world, while at the same time grounding and elevating the metaphysical priority of souls and forms. Furthermore, he believes that Platonism provides the most solid philosophical foundation for Christianity. Throughout the Platonic Theology, Ficino embraces the metaphysical distinction, prominent in Plato’s dialogues, between being and becoming or between the intelligible and sensible realms. He argues that the former is more real than the latter, and is therefore more worthy of our enduring attention, devotion, and study. Along these lines he maintains that forms are the perfect archetypes of all material things and exist unchangeably in the divine mind. They are in fact the genuine cause of the sensible qualities and properties of the material world. By contrast, the world of matter is shadowy and deceptive. It engenders confusion and imprisons the minds of many people.

Ficino’s metaphysics is overwhelmingly Platonic. But his theory of material substances is indebted to Scholasticism for many of its most salient features. While Ficino’s philosophy is clearly otherworldly—in the sense that he maintains the existence and metaphysical priority of realities apart from the material world—this does not prevent him from speculating about the metaphysics of matter and body in the early books of the Platonic Theology. In fact, he believes that doing so is in keeping with the broader aims of the book. By and large, Ficino analyzes material substances along traditional hylomorphic lines, according to which they are constituted by three principles: matter, form, and privation. Matter functions as the passive substrate of the forms that are active in making something what it is, and privation is what a substance can potentially become. The matter of a thing is relative to the level of organization under consideration; the matter of a statue is marble, but the marble itself is not without its own form and matter. When all qualities, both substantial and accidental, are stripped from a substance there is at bottom a single formless prime matter that is one and the same for all things. He holds that prime matter exists in a chaotic and confused state of potency. For Ficino, it is something that is ontologically basic and epistemically impenetrable. It is therefore difficult, if not impossible, to say anything directly about it other than that it must exist as the substratum of form. Here Ficino is echoing Plotinus who compared understanding matter to the eye seeing darkness.

Even though Ficino employs the basic terms of the Scholastics, he makes significant modifications to this framework. These changes are consistent with his broader philosophical commitments and the overall objectives of the Platonic Theology. First, it is noteworthy that he embraces a theory of seminal reasons, according to which seeds are spread throughout matter, and are the cause of things coming to be at appointed times. Unlike the Scholastics, Ficino judges that the qualities or properties of material things are protean, not self-sufficient, unstable, and parasitic on incorporeal forms for any reality and causal efficacy in the world of matter. Here his underlying Platonism becomes apparent. Ficino says that material forms are corrupted and contaminated when they are embedded in the “bosom” of matter. He poetically describes material qualities as “mere shadows that come and go like the reflections of lofty trees in a rushing stream”  (I.III.15). Ficino sees the basic elements of the world as existing in a constant and chaotic state of change, and he holds that whatever stability they exhibit is on account of their cause, that is, their incorporeal archetypes. According to Ficino, this is not merely true of the elements, but of all qualities of material things across the board, both those that are substantial and those that are accidental. In this way, Ficino traces back all of the qualities of this world to something eternal and incorporeal as their cause, and this is the basic unit of reality for him. He accepts a metaphysical principle that there is a first in each genus (primum) that is the fullest and most perfect expression of any particular species quality. It does not include anything that does not properly belong to that genus. The first in each genus is ultimately the cause of every particular expression of that quality. Ficino, therefore, demotes the reality of material forms or qualities while at the same time buttressing the reality of incorporeal forms. Although he analyzes material substances along hylomorphic lines, he at the same time alters this framework in an effort to ground his Platonic metaphysics, and ultimately the immortality of the soul.

There are prominent Neoplatonic elements at the core of Ficino’s metaphysics. He inherited from Plotinus a particular approach to metaphysics that is a hierarchical superstructure, with distinct levels or hypostases, all of which draw their being from an overflowing singular source. The source of all being is the One for Plotinus and God for Ficino. He considers all being to be a progressive emanation from the divine, and although each hypostasis is distinct, what is above serves as a dynamic bridge to what is below. Everything in Ficino’s cosmos has its own unique place and degree of perfection, beginning with God at the summit and descending through the celestial spheres, angels, and souls, all the way down to the elements of the terrestrial sphere. In it there is nothing that is vain or superfluous, and Ficino thinks that everything is drawn to its good or end by a natural appetite.

Ficino generally recognizes five distinct levels of reality. But he at times changes the precise arrangement and structure of the hypostases of this hierarchy. At the top of the hierarchy is God, which is the source of all being and perfection. The first hypostasis that God produces is angelic mind. It contains the archetypes and forms of all things in a timeless and immutable state. These forms are the essences of all possible entities, and they are responsible for the qualities and properties of material things. Next in this progression comes the rational soul, which imparts motion and vitality to the cosmos. Ficino posits a World Soul (anima mundi) that is immanent in all of nature, and individual souls that animate sundry entities in the world, including the celestial spheres, living creatures, and even the elements. Mind is eternal and unmoving; soul is likewise eternal, but differs because it is in a perpetual state of motion. Soul stands at the metaphysical node or bond between what is above and below; while it is drawn to forms and the divine above, it is responsible for the governance of what comes below. Beneath rational soul is the hypostasis of quality, which is representative of the material forms found in nature. The patterns of qualities are grounded in the second hypostasis, mind; the source of its motion and alteration comes from soul. Finally, the hierarchy of being is extinguished with the lowest level of reality—body or corporeal matter. Ficino defines body as matter that is extended in length, breadth, and depth. It functions as the bearer of qualities, but contributes nothing of its own to the nature of things.

Even though Ficino generally marks a distinction between being and becoming, or between the incorporeal and corporeal, he is no simple dualist. His view of soul, and the role that it plays in the material world, is fundamentally different from, for example, the strict dualism of the seventeenth-century philosopher René Descartes. Matter and soul are entirely distinct from one another, according to Descartes, and these two basic substances share no qualities in common. In his treatise on physics, The World, Descartes distinguishes himself from earlier approaches to natural philosophy when he explains that he uses the word “nature” to “signify matter itself,” and not “some goddess or any other sort of imaginary power” (AT XI 37). According to Descartes, a natural philosopher does not need to appeal to anything other than matter in order to properly explain the natural world. On the contrary, according to Ficino, the material world is not something that can be adequately explained by turning to matter and motion alone; nature is an active power that suffuses matter and provides it with its life, activity, and order. On this account, nature is a dynamic force operating on material things from within, and this is the proper or genuine cause of things changing, as well as their generation and corruption. Soul, therefore, has a paramount role to play in Ficino’s natural philosophy.

Like Plato and his Neoplatonic interpreters, Ficino makes competing claims about the relative goodness of the material world. In his Timaeus, Plato argues that the sensible world is on a whole good and beautiful because it is modeled on eternal forms. In other dialogues, such as the Phaedo and Republic, the sensible world is a shadowy and deceptive prison. Plotinus recognizes this tension in Plato and comments on it in his Enneads. Ficino inherits this ambiguity about the goodness of the world, even if negative appraisals are more frequent and prominent in the Platonic Theology than positive ones. Like Plato, Ficino asserts that the creator is a benevolent and wise architect, and that these qualities are reflected in God’s creation; however, he also maintains that the world of matter is shadowy, evil, and to some degree unreal. Furthermore, Ficino blames matter and body for the mind’s tendency to be confused and deceived about what is real and good. On a whole, therefore, Ficino’s overall assessment of the material world—at least as far as the human condition is concerned—is negative.

In his metaphysics, Ficino is not drawn to austere and desert-like frameworks, and he was not reductionistic in his thinking. As such, he belongs to a tradition of metaphysicians, including the seventeenth-century Platonist G. W. Leibniz, that embrace a rich and expansive ontology. Ficino lays out a tapestry of entities that comprise the world. In nature alone he countenances the existence of matter, qualities, and a cavalcade of souls, including a World Soul, that impart motion and vital powers to all aspects of the material world. Ficino claims that nature is in fact replete with souls; there are souls that belong to the elements, to non-human animals, as well as a soul that is responsible for the growth of rocks and trees from the earth’s surface.

b. Epistemology

In the Platonic Theology, Ficino does not address epistemological issues as directly or with the same degree of frequency as he does metaphysical ones. Nonetheless, the broad contours of a view can be sketched by paying close attention to the occasional discussion of the origin, nature, and value of knowledge. Throughout this work Ficino makes scattered remarks about the mind’s capabilities, what exactly it apprehends when it knows, and the effect that knowledge has on those who possess it. Generally these comments arise when Ficino is either discussing the nature and powers of the human mind and distinguishing them from the body, or when he speculates about the divine mind and draws a comparison with finite minds.

Ficino holds that knowledge is rooted in forms, not matter. However, the metaphysics of matter described above has certain implications for what exactly stands as the object of knowledge. He argues that the degradation of forms in matter requires that the mind grasps something other than sensible forms when it knows. If it did not, he argues, then knowledge would not be stable and fixed; instead, it would vary and change as the qualities of material things do. Rather, when the mind knows it apprehends intelligible forms, and not the sensible forms that include the individual traits that are distinctive of particular objects. These forms are stable and unchanging, and as such Ficino claims that they produce stable and unchanging knowledge.

Knowledge does not, according to Ficino, come about in stages, or as a result of a gradual process. The mind does not take gradual steps and build upon its experiences to arrive at universals. On the contrary, he describes knowledge as coming about in an instantaneous flash, and not in a progressive or abstractive manner. Ficino claims that philosophical reflection on the nature of things prepares and purifies the mind of falsehood until it is ready to receive the clarity of truth. This arrival is simple and immediate. Ficino explains that “speculative virtue does not proceed stage by stage from one part of itself to another, but blazes forth wholly and suddenly” (VIII.III.6). Ficino even holds that intelligible forms are distinct from, and discontinuous with, sensible forms, even if our experience of particular material things can be the root cause of the mind’s coming to know something. Furthermore, he makes some interesting suggestions about the existence of primary truths that contain other truths within them, and he claims that the knowledge of one primary truth can elicit knowledge of others. While Ficino mentions that such primary truths exist, he does not elaborate as to what exactly these truths are or what one would look like.

There are several Platonic epistemic themes that are prominent in the Platonic Theology. Ficino maintains that the mind is nourished by truth, and he sees it as edifying of the overall condition of the human soul. He also claims that there is much to recommend the Platonic doctrine of reminiscence, even if he rejects the transmigration of souls as heretical. Also, his description of learning calls to mind Plato’s Theaetetus, where Socrates describes himself as a midwife of sorts. In this vein, Ficino holds that the mind already has within itself the intelligible forms that it will, if it is diligent, come to know, or remember. These forms exist latently in the mind, and learning is a process of drawing out from the mind what is, in a certain sense, already there.

c. The Dignity of Humanity and the Human Condition

The metaphysical hierarchy outlined in the above section on metaphysics has significant philosophical consequences for both the dignity of the rational soul, and the qualitative character of the human condition. Ficino argues that the soul’s location on the chain of being lends to it a privileged position on the hierarchy of being, and is therefore responsible for its dignity and uniqueness. In different contexts Ficino changes the precise structure of this pentadic hierarchy, but the soul’s centrality is a consistent theme. This is an alteration of Plotinus’ original hierarchy and ensures the soul’s dignity and immortality. The soul is situated at the precise center of the hierarchy standing midway between God above and matter below. Ficino explains the structure of his metaphysics in the following way:

We would do well to call soul the third and middle essence, as the Platonists do, because it is the mean for all and the third from both directions. If you descend from God, you will find soul at the third level down; or at the third level up, if you ascend from body.

In the same chapter he continues:

But the third essence set between them is such that it cleaves to the higher while not abandoning the lower; and in it, therefore the higher and the lower are linked together… So by a natural instinct it ascends to the higher and descends to the lower. In ascending it does not abandon the things below it; in descending, it does not relinquish the things above it. (III.II.1-2)

The soul is the “fitting knot” or “node” that binds the upper half of the hierarchy with the lower. On account of its place in the hierarchy, Ficino explains that the soul is at one and the same time drawn to what is above, as well as responsible for the governance of nature below. Further, Ficino thinks that it shares some properties in common with what is above and below, and as a result it is perfectly well-suited to serve as the bridge between the upper and the lower halves of the hierarchy. The soul is eternal and immortal because it shares in divinity above. It also suffuses all of nature and lends to its motion and vitality. Ficino sees the soul as charged with the governance of the material world, and is intimately responsible for its potential well-being. This is a unique and privileged metaphysical role for it. He argues that the soul is not connected to any distinct part of the body, but communicates its life-giving power throughout.

The soul’s centrality in the great chain of being ensures its dignity and immortality. However, it is also responsible for its wretchedness and depravity. The soul’s proximity to the body has a negative effect on its ability to truly appreciate its own nature and immortality. Individual souls are by and large overwhelmed with the governance of their bodies, and the material world assaults them with violent motions and sensations. As a result the soul may fail to recognize its own nature and divinity. The conditions of embodiment also frustrate its search for truth. Metaphysically speaking, it functions as the node between the upper and the lower, but in practice it is wedded so tightly with matter that it naturally, Ficino believes, comes to the conclusion that it is not distinct from it. This is the cause of the common sense materialism that most people uncritically accept, and that says something is not real unless it is a body. A pivotal consequence of this situation is that the soul forgets its own privileged nature and divinity, and in many cases concludes that it is nothing distinct from matter. Thus, there is a disconnect in Ficino’s philosophy between the metaphysical nature of the soul, and its subjective experience when joined with matter. This is the cause, according to Ficino, of the wretchedness of the human condition, which is characterized by a certain confusion regarding what is real and worthy of its pursuit.

d. The Immortality of the Soul

The primary aim of the Platonic Theology is of course to demonstrate the immortality of the soul. Ficino provides a plurality of arguments across the eighteen books of this work. He argues that the soul’s immortality is a consequence of its position on the metaphysical hierarchy. He also provides arguments that rest upon the metaphysical and epistemological foundations of the Platonic Theology. Still other arguments are polemical and aim at refuting relevant and uneliminated alternatives, such as the positions of Epicurus and Averroes. Epicurus and Averroes—with the former denying immortality, and the latter claiming that it was one and the same for all—were growing in popularity in some academic circles in fifteenth-century Italy.

First and foremost, Ficino argues that the natural appetite for immortality entails post-mortem existence for the soul. He starts with the assumption that our primary goal is to ascend to a spiritual union with God, and he holds that this is a basic and natural desire shared and acted on by most human beings. If these efforts were to go unfulfilled, Ficino concludes that they would be otiose, vain, and even perverse. Perhaps more importantly, this would stand in direct violation of the perfection of nature and the wisdom of God. Thus, Ficino concludes that the natural desire for immortality must be vindicated in an actual afterlife.

In addition, in the Platonic Theology Ficino puts forward two prominent argument types that draw upon the nature and powers of the human mind, and on his theory of matter and body. He aims to show that the rational powers of the soul all support immortality and that these essential functions are in no way dependent upon matter and body. He argues that there is a correspondence or likeness between incorporeal entities and the soul. The intellect knows best when it does not depend upon the body or the senses whatsoever, and instead experiences an immediate union with forms. Ficino says that “when the soul despises corporeals and when the senses have been allayed and the clouds of phantasmata dissipated … then the intellect discerns truly and is at its brightest” (IX.II.2). Ficino takes this as evidence that the soul did not originate with the body. Instead, he argues that the soul is ineluctably drawn to things divine, and its union with incorporeals comes most naturally to it. He says that the soul was born for the contemplation of things divine, and through them it is enriched and perfected. Both the soul’s correspondence to incorporeals and the pull that they have on it are indicative of its underlying nature—like things incorporeal, it is immortal.

Ficino also aims to show that there are dissimilarities between the soul and matter. He argues that the essential functions of the mind are distinct from the body, and further that body cannot in any way give rise to them. These arguments aim to refute materialists who think that matter can give rise to the soul’s essential functions. Ficino argues that the soul’s most important operations are inconsistent with the basic conditions of corporeality. In fact, the body, the senses, and the passions all conspire to impede and frustrate the soul in its search for knowledge and goodness. Much like Plato in the Phaedo, Ficino argues that the soul’s overall condition improves the farther it is removed from the material world, and the soul knows best when it does not draw upon the senses. These dissimilarities establish, Ficino thinks, the soul’s essential otherness from matter and body. Ficino’s metaphysics of matter is also tailored to provide support for immortality. He provides what he calls a “Platonic” definition of body, according to which it is composed of matter and extension. Both matter and extension are passive and inert, and cannot give rise in any way to the essential functions of the soul. Therefore, Ficino concludes that it is only on account of the presence of something incorporeal, namely forms and souls, that material things are at all substantial.

5. Ethics and Love

Ficino did not compose a systematic treatise on ethics. Nonetheless, his familiarity with classical Greek philosophy means that ethical considerations are central to many of his philosophical works, and he often comes around to discussing human virtues and well-being. Ficino does not generally place an emphasis on the rightness of actions, or on duties or obligations for that matter. Instead, he focuses on the health and development of the whole person, which is consistent with what is today called virtue ethics. Ficino marks the traditional distinction between intellectual and moral virtues. The speculative virtues concern, for instance, the understanding of things divine, the knowledge of nature, and the craftsman’s ability to produce artifacts. This species of virtue is acquired through learning and speculation, and it is characterized by an intellectual state of clarity. The moral virtues come about through custom and habit, and their domain is human desires and appetites. Ficino holds that the end of moral virtues is to purify the soul and to ultimately release it from the sometimes overwhelming demands made by the body. Thus, moral virtue produces a state of soul that governs desires and appetites so that they do not take control of the soul, thereby leading to an incontinent or intemperate character. In the end, both the speculative and moral virtues are consistent with Ficino’s broader aspirations as a Christian Platonist. For him the virtues are prerequisites that prepare the soul for its inner ascent up the hierarchy of being, ultimately uniting it with God.

Ficino’s theory of love plays a central role in his ethics. He defines love as the desire for beauty. Love originates with God, and it is the link or bond that all things share in common. Here Ficino follows the patterns left by Plato and Plotinus. Beautiful things ignite or inspire the soul with love. When an individual thing is loved properly, the soul ascends progressively from love of the particular to the universal. The lover, therefore, turns inwardly to the soul from the corporeal world, and thus ultimately finds its end in God. However, it is possible for the soul to love improperly and become fixated on beautiful objects. This results in a life of confusion and wretchedness. Thus, for Ficino, the proper application of love lies at the heart of human happiness.

6. Legacy

Ficino left an enduring impression on the history of Western philosophy. His philosophical writings, and his translations of Platonic and Hermetic texts, exercised both a direct and indirect influence on the form and content of philosophy in subsequent centuries. The Platonic Theology was instrumental in elevating the defense of the immortality of the soul to philosophical prominence in the early modern period. It contributed to the Lateran Council of 1512 requiring philosophers to defend the immortality of the soul and the existence of God. In the letter of dedication to his Meditations on First Philosophy, Descartes refers to the Lateran Council to explain, in part, the proofs of God’s existence and immortality found therein. Ficino’s influence can also be seen in many of the most noteworthy philosophers of the sixteenth century, most notably Giordano Bruno, and Francesco Patrizi da Cherso, who held a chair of Platonic philosophy at the University of Ferrara. He indirectly influenced generations of philosophers who encountered Platonism and Hermeticism through his translations and commentaries.

The fortune of Ficino’s philosophical legacy has waxed and waned over the centuries. His influence on intellectual life in the sixteenth century was especially strong, but his brand of Christian Platonism was certainly not without its critics in subsequent centuries. The sixteenth-century theologian and historian Johannes Serranus criticized Ficino’s mode of translating and commenting on Plato’s dialogues, which he thought lacked clarity, brevity, and precision. The self-proclaimed Platonist G. W. Leibniz complains that Ficino’s definitions lack the rigor of Plato’s, and he says that his Neoplatonism incorporates too many pagan elements and is therefore prone to heresy. In his Lectures on the History of Philosophy, G. W. F. Hegel gives Ficino a minor and subordinate role to play in the development of modern philosophy. Hegel argues that Ficino’s revival of Platonic philosophy was ultimately a misguided and childish fascination with a dead philosophy. Perhaps more importantly, however, is the fact that Ficino’s philosophy stands in stark contrast to the methods and explanations employed by the new science in the seventeenth century. Hobbes and Descartes, for example, wanted to explain nature in purely materialistic and mechanical terms. The new philosophy and science, therefore, repudiates the vital core of Ficino’s metaphysics, especially his belief in a World Soul and his vitalistic natural philosophy. Hobbes outright rejects an incorporeal soul, and Descartes completely expels it from nature. Both philosophers, therefore, aspired to explain nature in such a way that it did not include many of the core features of the Ficino’s thought.

For a longtime Ficino remained a marginal figure and a footnote in histories of philosophy. It was not until nearly the middle of the twentieth century, when Paul Oskar Kristeller published his seminal book, The Philosophy of Marsilio Ficino, that historians of philosophy started to re-examine and reconsider Ficino’s importance to the history of Renaissance and early modern philosophies. Kristeller’s book examined the formal structure of Ficino’s philosophy, and he painted a picture of a sophisticated and systematic metaphysician. More recently a number of articles and books have been published on other aspects of Ficino’s thought. Since Kristeller, later scholars—such as D. P. Walker, Frances Yates, and Michael J. B. Allen—have focused less on the systematic and formal philosophy, and more on the magical and creative elements of Ficino’s thought. The critical examination of Ficino, and an assessment of his influence, continues today.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Ficino, Marsilio. Opera Omnia. 2 vols. Basel, 1576.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. The Letters of Marsilio Ficino. Trans. The Language Department of the London School of Economics. 8 vols. London: Shepheard-Walwyn Ltd., 1975-2010.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. The Philebus Commentary. Ed. and trans. Michael J. B. Allen. Berkeley and Los Angeles:  University of California Press, 1975.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. Commentaries on Plato’s Symposium on Love. Trans. Sears Jayne. Dallas: Spring Publications, 1985.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. Three Books on Life. Ed. and trans. Carol Kaske and John Clark. Tempe, Arizona: MRTS, 1998.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. Platonic Theology. Trans. Michael J. B. Allen, and ed. James Hankins. 6 vols. Cambridge: The I Tatti Renaissance Library, Harvard University Press, 2001-2006.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. Commentaries on Plato: Phaedrus and Ion. Cambridge: The I Tatti Renaissance Library, Harvard University Press, 2008.
  • Ficino, Marsilio. All Things Natural: Ficino on Plato’s Timaeus. Trans. Arthur Farndell. London: Shepheard-Walwyn Ltd., 2010.
  • Kristeller, Paul Oskar. Supplementum Ficinianum. 2 vols. Florence: Olschki, 1938.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Allen, Michael J. B. Icastes: Marsilio Ficino’s Interpretation of Plato’s Sophist. Berkeley and Los Angeles:  University of California Press, 1989.
    • A translation of Ficino’s Sophist commentary and discussion of his ontology.
  • Allen, Michael J. B. Synoptic Art: Marsilio Ficino and the History of Platonic Interpretation. Florence: Olschki, 1998.
    • Ficino’s philosophy and the history of later Platonism.
  • Celenza, Christopher. “Pythagoras in the Renaissance: The Case of Marsilio Ficino.” Renaissance Quarterly 52 (1999): 667-711.
    • A study of Ficino’s appropriation of classical Greek philosophy.
  • Collins, Ardis. B. The Secular is Sacred: Platonism and Thomism in Ficino’s Platonic Theology. The Hague: Nijhoff, 1974.
    • An examination of Ficino’s debt to Aquinas, especially the Summa Contra Gentiles.
  • Copenhaver, Brian P. and Charles Schmitt. Renaissance Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992.
    • A detailed and exhaustive study of Renaissance philosophy with a significant discussion of Ficino’s thought.
  • Field, Arthur. The Origins of the Platonic Academy of Florence. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1988.
    • A study of the social and intellectual role that the Platonic Academy of Florence.
  • Kristeller, Paul Oskar. The Philosophy of Marsilio Ficino. New York: Columbia University Press, 1943.
    • The authoritative guide to Ficino’s formal philosophy.
  • Hankins, James. Plato in the Italian Renaissance. 2 vols. Leiden: Brill, 1989.
    • The definitive examination of the Renaissance revival of Plato. A complete examination of the Renaissance revival of Plato not limited to Ficino.
  • Snyder, James G. “The theory of materia prima in Ficino’s Platonic Theology.” Vivarium 46 (2008): 192-221.
    • A study of the metaphysics and epistemology of Ficino’s theories of prime and corporeal matter.
  • Snyder, James G. “Marsilio Ficino’s Critique of the Lucretian Alternative.”  Journal of the History of Ideas 72 (2011): 165-181.
    • An examination of Ficino’s critique of Epicurean materialism.
  • Walker, D. P. Spiritual and Demonic Magic: From Ficino to Campanella. London: The Warburg Institute, 1958.
    • An examination of Ficino’s theory of natural magic.
  • Yates, Frances A. Giordano Bruno and the Hermetic Tradition. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1964.
    • Examination of Ficino’s natural magic and the influence it had on Bruno.

Author Information

James G. Snyder
Marist College
U. S. A.

Michel de Montaigne (1533—1592)

MontaigneMichel de Montaigne is widely appreciated as one of the most important figures in the late French Renaissance, both for his literary innovations as well as for his contributions to philosophy.  As a writer, he is credited with having developed a new form of literary expression, the essay, a brief and admittedly incomplete treatment of a topic germane to human life that blends philosophical insights with historical anecdotes and autobiographical details, all unapologetically presented from the author’s own personal perspective.  As a philosopher, he is best known for his skepticism, which profoundly influenced major figures in the history of philosophy such as Descartes and Pascal.

All of his literary and philosophical work is contained in his Essays, which he began to write in 1572 and first published in 1580 in the form of two books.  Over the next twelve years leading up to his death, he made additions to the first two books and completed a third, bringing the work to a length of about one thousand pages.  While Montaigne made numerous additions to the book over the years, he never deleted or removed any material previously published, in an effort to represent accurately the changes that he underwent both as a thinker and as a person over the twenty years during which he wrote.  These additions add to the unsystematic character of the book, which Montaigne himself claimed included many contradictions.  It is no doubt due to the unsystematic nature of the Essays that Montaigne received relatively little attention from Anglo-American philosophers in the twentieth century.  Nonetheless, in recent years he has been held out by many as an important figure in the history of philosophy not only for his skepticism, but also for his treatment of topics such as the self, moral relativism, politics, and the nature of philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. The Philosophical Project of the Essays
  3. Skepticism
  4. Relativism
  5. Moral and Political Philosophy
  6. Influence
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Selected editions of Montaigne’s Essays in French and English
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life

Michel Eyquem de Montaigne was born at the Château Montaigne, located thirty miles east of Bordeaux, in 1533.  His father, Pierre Eyquem, was a wealthy merchant of wine and fish whose grandfather had purchased in 1477 what was then known as the Montaigne estate.  Montaigne’s mother, Antoinette de Loupes de Villeneuve, came from a  wealthy marrano family that had settled in Toulouse at the end of the 15th century.  Montaigne describes Eyquem as “the best father that ever was,” and mentions him often in the Essays.  Montaigne’s mother, on the other hand, is almost totally absent from her son’s book.  Amidst the turbulent religious atmosphere of sixteenth century France, Eyquem and his wife raised their children Catholic.  Michel, the eldest of eight children, remained a member of the Catholic Church his entire life, though three of his siblings became Protestants.

Eyquem, who had become enamored of novel pedagogical methods that he had discovered as a soldier in Italy, directed Montaigne’s unusual education.  As an infant, Montaigne was sent to live with a poor family in a nearby village so as to cultivate in him a natural devotion to “that class of men that needs our help.”  When Montaigne returned as a young child to live at the château, Eyquem arranged that Michel awake every morning to music.  He then hired a German tutor to teach Montaigne to speak Latin as his native tongue.  Members of the household were forbidden to speak to the young Michel in any language other than Latin, and, as a result, Montaigne reports that he was six years old before he learned any French.  It was at this time that Eyquem sent Montaigne to attend the prestigious Collège de Guyenne, where he studied under the Scottish humanist George Buchanan.

The details of Montaigne’s life between his departure from the Collège at age thirteen and his appointment as a Bordeaux magistrate in his early twenties are largely unknown.  He is thought to have studied the law, perhaps at Toulouse.  In any case, by 1557 he had begun his career as a magistrate, first in the Cour des Aides de Périgueux, a court with sovereign jurisdiction in the region over cases concerning taxation, and later in the Bordeaux Parlement, one of the eight parlements that together composed the highest court of justice in France.  There he encountered Etienne La Boétie, with whom he formed an intense friendship that lasted until La Boétie’s sudden death in 1563.  Years later, the bond he shared with La Boétie would inspire one of Montaigne’s best-known essays, “Of Friendship.”  Two years after La Boétie’s death Montaigne married Françoise de la Chassaigne.  His relationship with his wife seems to have been amiable but cool; it lacked the spiritual and intellectual connection that Montaigne had shared with La Boétie.  Their marriage produced six children, but only one survived infancy: a daughter named Léonor.

In 1570 Montaigne sold his office in the Parlement, and retreated to his château, where in 1571 he announced his retirement from public life.  Less than a year later he began to write his Essays.  Retirement did not mean isolation, however.  Montaigne made many trips to court in Paris between 1570 and 1580, and it seems that at some point between 1572 and 1576 he attempted to mediate between the ultra-conservative Catholic Henri de Guise and the Protestant Henri, king of Navarre.  Nonetheless, he devoted a great deal of time to writing, and in 1580 published the first two books of his Essays.

Soon thereafter Montaigne departed on a trip to Rome via Germany and Switzerland.  Montaigne recorded the trip in the Journal de Voyage, which was published for the first time in the 18th century, not having been intended for publication by Montaigne himself.   Among the reasons for his trip were his hope of finding relief from his kidney stones in the mineral baths of Germany, his desire to see Rome, and his general love of travel.  The trip lasted about fifteen months, and would have lasted longer had he not been called back to Bordeaux in 1581 to serve as mayor.

Montaigne’s first two-year term as mayor was mostly uneventful.  His second term was much busier, as the death of the Duke of Anjou made the Protestant Henri de Navarre heir to the French throne.  This resulted in a three-way conflict between the reigning Catholic King Henri III, Henri de Guise, leader of the conservative Catholic League, and Henri de Navarre.  Bordeaux, which remained Catholic during the religious wars that engulfed France for most of the 16th century, found itself in close proximity to Navarre’s Protestant forces in southwest France.  As a mayor loyal to the king, Montaigne worked successfully to keep the peace among the interested parties, protecting the city from seizure by the League while also maintaining diplomatic relations with Navarre.   As a moderate Catholic, he was well-regarded by both the king and Navarre, and after his tenure as mayor Montaigne continued to serve as a diplomatic link between the two parties, at one point in 1588 traveling to Paris on a secret diplomatic mission for Navarre.

In 1588, Montaigne published the fifth edition of the Essays, including a third book with material he had produced in the previous two years.  It is a copy of this fifth edition (known as the “Bordeaux Copy”), including the marginalia penned by Montaigne himself in the years leading up to his death, which in the eyes of most scholars constitutes the definitive text of the Essays today.  The majority of the last three years of his life were spent at the château.  When Navarre succeeded Henri III as king of France in 1589, he invited Montaigne to join him at court, but Montaigne was too ill to travel.  His body was failing him, and he died less than two years later, on September 13, 1592.

2. The Philosophical Project of the Essays


All of Montaigne’s philosophical reflections are found in his Essays.  To contemporary readers, the term “essay” denotes a particular literary genre.  But when Montaigne gives the title Essays to his book, he does not intend to designate the literary genre of the work so much as to refer to the spirit in which it is written and the nature of the project out of which it emerges.  The term is taken from the French verb “essayer,” which  Montaigne employs in a variety of senses throughout his book, where it carries such meanings as “to attempt,” “to test,” “to exercise,” and “to experiment.”  Each of these expressions captures an aspect of Montaigne’s project in the Essays.  To translate the title of his book as “Attempts” would capture the modesty of Montaigne’s essays, while to translate it as “Tests” would reflect the fact that he takes himself to be testing his judgment.  “Exercises” would communicate the sense in which essaying is a way of working on oneself, while “Experiments” would convey the exploratory spirit of the book.

The Essays is a decidedly unsystematic work.  The text itself is composed of 107 chapters or essays on a wide range of topics, including - to name a few -  knowledge, education, love, the body, death, politics, the nature and power of custom, and the colonization of the New World.  There rarely seems to be any explicit connection between one chapter and the next.  Moreover, chapter titles are often only tangentially related to their contents.  The lack of logical progression from one chapter to the next creates a sense of disorder that is compounded by Montaigne’s style, which can be described as deliberately nonchalant.  Montaigne intersperses reportage of historical anecdotes and autobiographical remarks throughout the book, and most essays include a number of digressions.  In some cases the digressions seem to be due to Montaigne’s stream-of-consciousness style,  while in others they are the result of his habit of inserting additions (sometimes just a sentence or two, other times a number of paragraphs) into essays years after they were first written.  Finally, the nature of Montaigne’s project itself contributes to the disorderly style of his book.  Part of that project, he tells us at the outset, is to paint a portrait of himself in words, and for Montaigne, this task is complicated by the conception he has of the nature of the self.  In “Of repentance,” for example, he announces that while others try to form man, he simply tells of a particular man, one who is constantly changing:

I cannot keep my subject still.  It goes along befuddled and staggering, with a natural drunkenness.  I take it in this condition, just as it is at the moment I give my attention to it.  I do not portray being: I portray passing….  I may presently change, not only by chance, but also by intention.  This is a record of various and changeable occurrences, and of irresolute and, when it so befalls, contradictory ideas: whether I am different myself, or whether I take hold of my subjects in different circumstances and aspects.  So, all in all, I may indeed contradict myself now and then; but truth, as Demades said, I do not contradict. (F 610)

Given Montaigne’s expression of this conception of the self as a fragmented and ever-changing entity, it should come as no surprise that we find contradictions throughout the Essays.  Indeed, one of the apparent contradictions in Montaigne’s thought concerns his view of the self.  While on the one hand he expresses the conception of the self outlined in the passage above, in the very same essay - as if to illustrate the principle articulated above - he asserts that his self is unified by his judgment, which has remained essentially the same his entire life.  Such apparent contradictions, in addition to Montaigne’s style and the structure that he gives his book, complicate the task of reading the Essays and have understandably led to diverse interpretations of its contents.

The stated purposes of Montaigne’s essays are almost as diverse as their contents.  In addition to the pursuit of self-knowledge, Montaigne also identifies the cultivation of his judgment and the presentation of a new ethical and philosophical figure to the reading public as fundamental goals of his project. There are two components to Montaigne’s pursuit of self-knowledge.  The first is the attempt to understand the human condition in general.  This involves reflecting on the beliefs, values, and behavior of human beings as represented both in literary, historical, and philosophical texts, and in his own experience.  The second is to understand himself as a particular human being.  This involves recording and reflecting upon his own idiosyncratic tastes, habits, and dispositions.  Thus in the Essays one finds a great deal of historical and autobiographical content, some of which seems arbitrary and insignificant.  Yet for Montaigne, there is no detail that is insignificant when it comes to understanding ourselves: “each particle, each occupation, of a man betrays and reveals him just as well as any other” (F 220).

A second aim of essaying himself is to cultivate his judgment.  For Montaigne, “judgment” refers to all of our intellectual faculties as well as to the particular acts of the intellect; in effect, it denotes the interpretive lens through which we view the world.  In essaying himself, he aims to cultivate his judgment in a number of discrete but related ways.  First, he aims to transform customary or habitual judgments into reflective judgments by calling them into question.  In a well-known passage from “Of custom, and not easily changing an accepted law,” Montaigne discusses how habit “puts to sleep the eye of our judgment.”  To “wake up” his judgment from its habitual slumber, Montaigne must call into question those beliefs, values, and judgments that ordinarily go unquestioned.  By doing so, he is able to determine whether or not they are justifiable, and so whether to take full ownership of them or to abandon them.  In this sense we can talk of Montaigne essaying, or testing, his judgment.  We find clear examples of this in essays such as “Of drunkenness” and “Of the resemblance of children to their fathers,” where he tests his pre-reflective attitudes toward drunkenness and doctors, respectively.  Another aspect of the cultivation of judgment has to do with exercising it through simple practice.  Thus Montaigne writes that in composing his essays, he is presenting his judgment with opportunities to exercise itself:

Judgment is a tool to use on all subjects, and comes in everywhere.  Therefore in the tests (essais) that I make of it here, I use every sort of occasion.  If it is a subject I do not understand at all, even on that I essay my judgment, sounding the ford from a good distance; and then, finding it too deep for my height, I stick to the bank.  And this acknowledgment that I cannot cross over is a token of its action, indeed one of those it is most proud of.  Sometimes in a vain and nonexistent subject I try (j’essaye) to see if [my judgment] will find the wherewithal to give it body, prop it up, and support it.  Sometimes I lead it to a noble and well-worn subject in which it has nothing original to discover, the road being so beaten that it can only walk in others’ footsteps.  There it plays its part by choosing the way that seems best to it, and of a thousand paths it says that this one or that was the most wisely chosen.  (F 219)

The third fundamental goal of essaying himself is to present his unorthodox way of living and thinking to the reading public of 16th century France.  He often remarks his intense desire to make himself and his unusual ways known to others.  Living in a time of war and intolerance, in which men were concerned above all with honor and their appearance in the public sphere, Montaigne presents his own way of life as an attractive alternative.  While he supports the monarchy and the Catholic Church, his support is measured and he is decidedly tolerant of other views and other ways of life (see, for example, “Of Cato the Younger”).  He vehemently opposes the violent and cruel behavior of many of the supporters of the Catholic cause, and recognizes the humanity of those who oppose them.  Espousing an openness antithetical to contemporary conventions, he openly declares his faults and failures, both moral and intellectual.  Finally, he emphasizes the values of private life and the fact that the true test of one’s character is how one behaves in private, not how one behaves in public.  In other words, Montaigne challenges the martial virtues of the day that he believes have led to cruelty, hypocrisy, and war, by presenting himself as an example of the virtues of gentleness, openness, and compromise.

Just as Montaigne presents his ways of life in the ethical and political spheres as alternatives to the ways common among his contemporaries, so he presents his ways of behaving in the intellectual sphere as alternatives to the common ways of thinking found among the learned.  He consistently challenges the Aristotelian authority that governed the universities of his day, emphasizing the particular over the universal, the concrete over the abstract, and experience over reason.  Rejecting the form as well as the content of academic philosophy, he abandons the rigid style of the medieval quaestio for the meandering and disordered style of the essay.  Moreover, he devalues the faculty of memory, so cultivated by renaissance orators and educators, and places good judgment in its stead as the most important intellectual faculty.  Finally, Montaigne emphasizes the personal nature of philosophy, and the value of self-knowledge over metaphysics.  His concern is always with the present, the concrete, and the human.

Rather than discursively arguing for the value of his ways of being, both moral and intellectual, Montaigne simply presents them to his readers:

These are my humors and my opinions; I offer them as what I believe, not what is to be believed.  I aim here only at revealing myself, who will perhaps be different tomorrow, if I learn something new which changes me.  I have no authority to be believed, nor do I want it, feeling myself too ill-instructed to instruct others. (F 108)

Yet while he disavows authority, he admits that he presents this portrait of himself in the hopes that others may learn from it (“Of practice”).  Thus the end of essaying himself is simultaneously private and public.  Montaigne desires to know himself, and to cultivate his judgment, and yet at the same time he seeks to offer his ways of life as salutary alternatives to those around him.

3. Skepticism

Montaigne is perhaps best known among philosophers for his skepticism.  Just what exactly his skepticism amounts to has been the subject of considerable scholarly debate.  Given the fact that he undoubtedly draws inspiration for his skepticism from his studies of the ancients, the tendency has been for scholars to locate him in one of the ancient skeptical traditions.  While some interpret him as a modern Pyrrhonist, others have emphasized what they take to be the influence of the Academics.  Still other scholars have argued that while there are clearly skeptical moments in his thought, characterizing Montaigne as a skeptic fails to capture the nature of Montaigne’s philosophical orientation.  Each of these readings captures an aspect of Montaigne’s thought, and consideration of the virtues of each of them in turn provides us with a fairly comprehensive view of Montaigne’s relation to the various philosophical positions that we tend to identify as “skeptical.”

The Pyrrhonian skeptics, according to Sextus Empiricus’ Outlines of Pyrrhonism, use skeptical arguments to bring about what they call equipollence between opposing beliefs.  Once they recognize two mutually exclusive and equipollent arguments for and against a certain belief, they have no choice but to suspend judgment.  This suspension of judgment, they say, is followed by tranquility, or peace of mind, which is the goal of their philosophical inquiry.

In “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” Montaigne expresses great admiration for the Pyrrhonists and their ability to maintain the freedom of their judgment by avoiding commitment to any particular theoretical position.  We find him employing the skeptical tropes introduced by Sextus in order to arrive at equipollence and then the suspension of judgment concerning a number of theoretical issues, from the nature of the divine to the veracity of perception.  In other essays, such as the very first essay of his book, ”By diverse means we arrive at the same end,” Montaigne employs skeptical arguments to bring about the suspension of judgment concerning practical matters, such as whether the best way to obtain mercy is by submission or defiance.  Introducing historical examples that speak for each of the two positions, he concludes that “truly man is a marvelously vain, diverse, and undulating object.  It is hard to found any constant and uniform judgment on him” (F 5).   We cannot arrive at any certain conclusion regarding practical matters any more than we can regarding theoretical matters.

If there are equipollent arguments for and against any practical course of action, however, we might wonder how Montaigne is to avoid the practical paralysis that would seem to follow from the suspension of judgment.  Here Sextus tells us that Pyrrhonists do not suffer from practical paralysis because they allow themselves to be guided by the way things seem to them, all the while withholding assent regarding the veracity of these appearances.  Thus Pyrrhonists are guided by passive acceptance of what Sextus calls the “fourfold observances”: guidance by nature, necessitation by feelings, the handing down of laws and customs, and the teaching of kinds of expertise.  The Pyrrhonist, then, having no reason to oppose what seems evident to her, will seek food when hungry, avoid pain, abide by local customs, and consult experts when necessary – all without holding any theoretical opinions or beliefs.

In certain cases, Montaigne seems to abide by the fourfold observances himself.  At one point in ”Apology for Raymond Sebond,” for instance, he seems to suggest that his allegiance to the Catholic Church is due to the fact that he was raised Catholic and Catholicism is the traditional religion of his country.  In other words, it appears that his behavior is the result of adherence to the fourfold observances of Sextus.  This has led some scholars, most notably Richard Popkin, to interpret him as a skeptical fideist who is arguing that because we have no reasons to abandon our customary beliefs and practices, we should remain loyal to them.  Indeed, Catholics would employ this argument in the Counter-Reformation movement of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries.  (Nonetheless, the Essays would also come to be placed on the Catholic Church’s Index of Prohibited Books in the late seventeenth century, where it would remain for nearly two hundred years.)

Yet, for all the affinities between Montaigne and the Pyrrhonists, he does not always suspend judgment, and he does not take tranquility to be the goal of his philosophical inquiry.  Thus Montaigne at times appears to have more in common with the Academic Skeptics than with the Pyrrhonists.  For the Academics, at certain points in the history of their school, seem to have allowed for admitting that some judgments are more probable or justified than others, thereby permitting themselves to make judgments, albeit with a clear sense of their fallibility.  Another hallmark of Academic Skepticism was the strategy of dialectically assuming the premises of their interlocutors in order to show that they lead to conclusions at odds with the interlocutors’ beliefs.  Montaigne seems to employ this argumentative strategy in the “Apology for Raymond Sebond.” There Montaigne dialectically accepts the premises of Sebond’s critics in order to reveal the presumption and confusion involved in their objections to Sebond’s project.  For example, Montaigne shows that according to the understanding of knowledge held by Sebond’s secular critics, there can be no knowledge.  This is not the dogmatic conclusion that it has appeared to be to some scholars, since Montaigne’s conclusion is founded upon a premise that he himself clearly rejects.  If we understand knowledge as Sebond’s critics do, then there can be no knowledge.  But there is no reason why we must accept their notion of knowledge in the first place.  In this way, just as the Academic Skeptics argued that their Stoic opponents ought to suspend judgment, given the Stoic principles to which they subscribe, so Montaigne shows that Sebond’s secular critics must suspend judgment, given the epistemological principles that they claim to espouse.

While many scholars, then, justifiably speak of Montaigne as a modern skeptic in one sense or another, there are others who emphasize aspects of his thought that separate him from the skeptical tradition.  Such scholars point out that many interpretations of Montaigne as a fundamentally skeptical philosopher tend to focus on “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” Montaigne’s most skeptical essay.  When we take a broader view of the Essays as a whole, we find that Montaigne’s employment of skeptical tropes is fairly limited and that for Montaigne, strengthening his judgment – one of his avowed goals in the Essays – does not amount to learning how to eliminate his beliefs.  While working on his judgment often involves setting opinions against each other, it also often culminates in a judgment regarding the truth of these opinions.  Thus Ann Hartle, for instance, has argued that Montaigne’s thought is best understood as dialectical.  In a similar vein, Hugo Friedrich has pointed out that Montaigne’s skepticism is not fundamentally destructive.  According to Friedrich, in cataloguing the diversity of human opinions and practices Montaigne does not wish to eliminate our beliefs but rather to display the fullness of reality.

Interpreting Montaigne as a skeptic, then, requires a good deal of qualification.  While he does suspend judgment concerning certain issues, and he does pit opinions and customs against one another in order to undermine customary ways of thinking and behaving, his skepticism is certainly not systematic.  He does not attempt to suspend judgment universally, and he does not hesitate to maintain metaphysical beliefs that he knows he cannot justify.  Thus the spirit of his skepticism is not characterized by principles such as “I suspend judgment,” or “Nothing can be known,” but rather, by his motto, the question “What do I know?”  Moreover, as Montaigne demonstrates, constantly essaying oneself does lead one to become more diffident of his or her judgment.  Montaigne’s remarks are almost always prefaced by acknowledgments of their fallibility: “I like these words, which soften and moderate the rashness of our propositions: ‘perhaps,’ ‘to some extent,’ ‘some,’ ‘they say,’ ‘I think,’ and the like” (F 788).  But it does not necessarily lead one to the epistemological anxiety or despair characteristic of modern forms of skepticism.  Rather than despairing at his ignorance and seeking to escape it at all costs, he wonders at it and takes it to be an essential part of the self-portrait that is his Essays.  Moreover, he considers the clear-sighted recognition of his ignorance an accomplishment insofar as it represents a victory over the presumption that he takes to be endemic to the human condition.

4. Relativism

One of the primary targets of Montaigne’s skeptical attack against presumption is ethnocentrism, or the belief that one’s culture is superior to others and therefore is the standard against which all other cultures, and their moral beliefs and practices, should be measured.  This belief in the moral and cultural superiority of one’s own people, Montaigne finds, is widespread.  It seems to be the default belief of all human beings.  The first step toward undermining this prejudice is to display the sheer multiplicity of human beliefs and practices.  Thus, in essays such as “Of some ancient customs,” “Of Custom, and not easily changing an accepted law,” and “Apology for Raymond Sebond” Montaigne catalogues the variety of behaviors to be found in the world in order to draw attention to the contingency of his own cultural norms.  By reporting many customs that are direct inversions of contemporary European customs, he creates something like an inverted world for his readers, stunning their judgment by forcing them to question which way is up: here men urinate standing up and women do so sitting down; elsewhere it is the opposite.  Here incest is frowned upon; in other cultures it is the norm.  Here we bury our dead; there they eat them.  Here we believe in the immortality of the soul; in other societies such a belief is nonsense.

Montaigne is not terribly optimistic about reforming the prejudices of his contemporaries, for simply reminding them of the apparent contingency of their own practices in most cases will not be enough.  The power of custom over our habits and beliefs, he argues, is stronger than we tend to recognize.  Indeed, Montaigne devotes almost as much time in the Essays to discussing the power of custom to shape the way we see the world as he does to revealing the various customs that he has come across in his reading and his travels.  Custom, whether personal or social, puts to sleep the eye of our judgment, thereby tightening its grip over us, since its effects can only be diminished through deliberate and self-conscious questioning.  It begins to seem as if it is impossible to escape custom’s power over our judgment: “Each man calls barbarism whatever is not his own practice; for indeed it seems we have no other test of truth and reason than the example and pattern of the opinions and customs of the country we live in” (F 152).

Montaigne’s concern with custom and cultural diversity, combined with his rejection of ethnocentrism, has led many scholars to argue that Montaigne is a moral relativist, that is, that he holds that that there is no objective moral truth and that therefore moral values are simply expressions of conventions that enjoy widespread acceptance at a given time and place.  Yet Montaigne never explicitly expresses his commitment to moral relativism, and there are aspects of the Essays that seem to contradict such an interpretation, as other scholars have noted.

These other scholars are inclined to interpret Montaigne as committed to moral objectivism, or the theory that there is in fact objective moral truth, and they point to a number of aspects of the Essays that would support such an interpretation.  First, Montaigne does not hesitate to criticize the practices of other cultures.  For instance, in “Of cannibals,” after praising the virtues of the cannibals, he criticizes them for certain behaviors that he identifies as morally vicious.  For a relativist, such criticism would be unintelligible: if there is no objective moral truth, it makes little sense to criticize others for having failed to abide by it.  Rather, since there is no external standard by which to judge other cultures, the only logical course of action is to pass over them in silence. Then there are moments when Montaigne seems to refer to categorical duties, or moral obligations that are not contingent upon either our own preferences or cultural norms (see, for example, the conclusion of “Of cruelty”).  Finally, Montaigne sometimes seems to allude to the existence of objective moral truth, for instance in “Of some verses of Virgil” and “Of the useful and the honorable,” where he distinguishes between relative and absolute values.

Thus Montaigne’s position regarding moral relativism remains the subject of scholarly dispute.  What is not a matter of dispute, however, is that Montaigne was keenly interested in undermining his readers’ thoughtless attitudes towards members of cultures different from their own, and that his account of the force of custom along with his critique of ethnocentrism had an impact on important later thinkers (see below).

5. Moral and Political Philosophy

Morally and politically, Montaigne has often been interpreted as a forerunner of modern liberalism.  This is due to his presentation of himself as a lover a freedom who is tolerant of difference and who wishes to maintain a rather robust distinction between the private and public spheres.  The question of the extent to which he is trying to transform the political values of his contemporaries, as well as the question of the extent to which Montaigne takes his position to be founded upon metaphysical principles, are both subjects of debate.  Some read him as writing the Essays with primarily political intentions, and among those who subscribe to such a reading, there is disagreement as to the nature of his argument.  On the one hand, some scholars argue that Montaigne’s political prescriptions are grounded on a theory of human nature combined with skepticism concerning the possibility of obtaining knowledge of transcendent truth.  On the other hand, some interpret Montaigne in a more postmodern vein, arguing that he is not so much making an argument on the basis of truth claims as he is simply changing the subject, diverting the attention of his readers away from the realm of the transcendent and its categorical obligations to the temporal realm and its private pleasures.  Still others hold that politics does not occupy the central place in the Essays that some might think, and that the political content of the Essays is neither dogmatic nor rhetorical, but rather is part and parcel of his fundamental project of seeking self-knowledge for himself and inspiring that same desire in others.  On this interpretation, Montaigne’s political project is much more modest.  He is simply offering a new moral and political figure to be considered, inviting readers to reflect for themselves on their own beliefs and practices in an effort to act as a Socratic gadfly to the slumbering French body politic.  While it must be left to the reader to decide the extent to which a full-fledged political doctrine can be discovered in the Essays, as well as whether Montaigne is attempting to exert direct influence over his readers, it is nonetheless possible to identify a number of attitudes, values, and commitments that are central both to Montaigne’s moral and political thought and to modern liberalism.

First and foremost is Montaigne’s commitment to tolerance.  Always amazed at the diversity of the forms of life that exist in the world, Montaigne consistently remarks his tolerant attitude toward those whose ways of life or fundamental beliefs and values differ from his own; he is not threatened by such disagreements, and he does not view those who are different as in need of correction:

I do not share that common error of judging another by myself.  I easily believe that another man may have qualities different from mine. Because I feel myself tied down to one form, I do not oblige everybody else to espouse it, as all others do. I believe in and conceive a thousand contrary ways of life (façons de vie); and in contrast with the common run of men, I more easily admit difference than resemblance between us. I am as ready as you please to acquit another man from sharing my conditions and principles. I consider him simply in himself, without relation to others; I mold him to his own model. (F 169)

While radical skepticism does not in and of itself entail a tolerant attitude towards others, it seems that Montaigne’s more modest skepticism, if combined with a commitment to an objective moral order the nature of which he cannot demonstrate, might explain his unwillingness to condemn those who are different.

Montaigne’s commitment to toleration of difference produces a fairly robust distinction between the private and public spheres in his thought.  When discussing his tenure as mayor in “Of husbanding your will,” for example, he insists that there is a clear distinction to be made between Montaigne the mayor and Montaigne himself.  He performs his office dutifully, but he does not identify himself with his public persona or his role as citizen, and he believes that there are limits to what may be expected from him by the state.  Similarly, he makes a sharp distinction between true friendship and the sort of acquaintances produced by working relationships.  While he believes he owes everything to his friends and he expects the same in return, from those with whom he is bound by some professional relationship, he expects nothing but the competent performance of their offices.  Their religion or their sexual habits, for example, are no concern of his (see “Of friendship”).

In part, Montaigne’s tolerance and his commitment to the separation of the private and public spheres are the products of his attitude towards happiness.  Aristotelianism and Christianity, the two dominant intellectual forces of Montaigne’s time, emphasize the objective character of human happiness, the core content of which is fundamentally the same for all members of the human species.  These conceptions of happiness each rest on the notion of a universal human nature.  Montaigne, so impressed by the diversity that he finds among human beings, speaks of happiness in terms of a subjective state of mind, a type of satisfaction which differs from particular human being to particular human being (see “That the taste of good and evil depends in large part on the opinion we have of them,” “Apology for Raymond Sebond,” and “Of experience”).  Convinced of the possibility that the content of happiness differs so significantly from one person to the next, Montaigne wishes to preserve a private sphere in which individuals can attempt to realize that happiness without having to contend with the interference of society.

Another distinctively modern feature of Montaigne’s moral thought is the fact that when he treats moral issues, he almost always does so without appealing to theology.  This is not to say that he does not believe that God underwrites the principles of morality (an issue which cannot be decided on the basis of the text), but simply that Montaigne’s moral discourse is not underwritten by theology, but rather by empathetic concerns for the well being of the other and the preservation of the social bond.  Thus he identifies cruelty to other living beings as the extreme of all vices (see “Of cruelty”), while dishonesty comes second in Montaigne’s ordering of the vices, since as human beings we are held together chiefly by our word (see “Of giving the lie”).  Other vices he treats in terms of the degree to which they clash with society.  So, for instance, he finds that drunkenness is not altogether bad, as it is not always harmful to society and it provides pleasures that add greatly to our enjoyment of life (“Of drunkenness”).

Montaigne has been thought by some to have been a hedonist, and while others would disagree with this interpretation, there is no doubt that he thinks pleasure is an integral part of a happy human life, and a very real motivating force in human actions, whether virtuous or vicious.  Much of his ethical reflection centers around the question of how to live as a human being, rather than as a beast or an angel, and he argues that those who disdain pleasure and attempt to achieve moral perfection as individuals, or who expect political perfection from states, end up resembling beasts more than angels.  Thus throughout the Essays the acceptance of imperfection, both in individual human beings and in social and political entities, is thematic.

This acceptance of imperfection as a condition of human private and social life, when combined with his misgivings about those who earnestly seek perfection, leads Montaigne to what has appeared to some as a commitment to political conservatism.  Yet this conservatism is not grounded in theoretical principles that endorse monarchy or the status quo as good in and of itself.  Rather, his conservatism is the product of circumstance.  As he writes in “Of custom, and not easily changing an accepted law,” he has witnessed firsthand the disastrous effects of attempts at political innovation, and this has led him to be generally suspicious of attempts to improve upon political institutions in anything more than a piecemeal fashion.  Yet this rule is not without its exceptions.  In the next breath he expresses the view that there are times when innovation is called for, and it is the work of judgment to determine when those times arise.

6. Influence


Montaigne’s influence has been diverse and widespread.  In the seventeenth century, it was his skepticism that proved most influential among philosophers and theologians.  After Montaigne’s death, his friend Pierre Charron, himself a prominent Catholic theologian, produced two works, Les Trois Véritez (1594) and La Sagesse (1601), that drew heavily from the Essays.  The former was primarily a theological treatise that united Pyrrhonian skepticism and Christian negative theology in an attempt to undermine Protestant challenges to the authority of the Catholic Church.  The latter was more philosophically oriented, and is considered by many to be little more than a systematized version of “Apology for Raymond Sebond.”  Nonetheless, it was immensely popular, and consequently it served as a conduit for Montaigne’s thought to many readers in the first part of the seventeenth century.  There is also clear evidence of Montaigne’s influence on Descartes, particularly in the latter’s Discourse on Method.  There, in addition to skepticism, Descartes took up a number of Montaignian themes, such as the diversity of values and practices among human beings, the power of custom to govern our judgment, and the decision, after having recognized that the philosophers have been unable to bring any of their questions to a decision after centuries of investigation, to engage in self-study.  Ultimately, of course, Descartes parted ways with Montaigne quite decisively when he developed his dogmatic accounts of knowledge, the nature of the soul, and the existence of God. Pascal, on the other hand, also profoundly influenced by the Essays, concluded that reason cannot answer the theoretical question of the existence of God, and that therefore it was necessary to inquire into the practical rationality of religious belief.

In the eighteenth century, the attention of the French philosophes focused not so much on Montaigne’s skepticism as on his portrayal of indigenous peoples of the New World, such as the tribe he describes in “Of cannibals.”  Inspired by Montaigne’s recognition of the noble virtues of such people, Denis Diderot and Jean-Jacques Rousseau created the ideal of the “noble savage,” which figured significantly in their moral philosophies.  Meanwhile, in Scotland, David Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature showed traces of Montaigne’s influence, as did his Essays, Moral and Political.

A century later, Montaigne would become a favorite of Ralph Waldo Emerson and Friedrich Nietzsche.  In Emerson’s essay “Montaigne; or, the Skeptic,” he extols the virtues of Montaigne’s brand of skepticism and remarks Montaigne’s capacity to present himself in the fullness of his being on the written page: “The sincerity and marrow of the man reaches into his sentences.  I know not anywhere the book that seems less written.  Cut these words, and they would bleed; they are vascular and alive.”  Nietzsche, for his part, admired Montaigne’s clear-sighted honesty and his ability to both appreciate and communicate the joy of existence.  In Schopenhauer as Educator, he writes of Montaigne: “the fact that such a man has written truly adds to the joy of living on this earth.”

In the twentieth century Montaigne was identified as a forerunner of various contemporary movements, such as postmodernism and pragmatism.  Judith Shklar, in her book Ordinary Vices, identified Montaigne as the first modern liberal, by which she meant that Montaigne was the first to argue that cruelty is the worst thing that we do.  In Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, Richard Rorty borrowed Shklar’s definition of a liberal to introduce the figure of the “liberal ironist.”  Rorty’s description of the liberal ironist as someone who is both a radical skeptic and a liberal in Shklar’s sense has led some to interpret Montaigne as having been a liberal ironist himself.

As many scholars have noted, the style of the Essays makes them amenable to a wide range of interpretations, which explains the fact that many thinkers with diverse worldviews have found the Essays to be a mirror in which they see their own reflection, albeit perhaps clarified to some degree by Montaigne’s penetrating insights into human nature.  This would not be inconsistent with Montaigne’s purposes.  In essaying himself publicly, he essays his readers as well, and in demonstrating a method of achieving self-knowledge, he undoubtedly intends to offer readers opportunities for self-discovery.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Selected editions of Montaigne’s Essays in French and English

  • Montaigne, Michel de.  Essais. 2nd Ed. Edited by Pierre Villey and V.-L. Saulnier. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1992.
  • Montaigne, Michel de. Essais. Edited by André Tournon.  Paris: Imprimerie nationale, 1998.
  • Montaigne, Michel de. Essais. Edited by J. Balsamo, M. Magnien, and C. Magnien-Simonin. Paris: Gallimard, 2007.
  • Montaigne, Michel de. The Complete Essays of Montaigne. Translated by Donald M. Frame.  Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1943.
    • The translation used in the quotations above, parenthetically cited as “F.”
  • Montaigne, Michel de. The Complete Essays. Translated by M.A. Screech.  New York: Penguin, 1991.
  • Montaigne, Michel de. Michel de Montaigne: The Complete Works. Translated by Donald M. Frame. New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 2003.
    • Includes the “Travel Journal” from Montaigne’s trip to Rome as well as letters from his correspondence.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Brush, Craig B. Montaigne and Bayle:  Variations on the Theme of Skepticism.  The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966.
    • A thorough treatment of Montaigne’s skepticism; includes a lengthy commentary on “Apology for Raymond Sebond.”
  • Cave, Terence. How to Read Montaigne. London: Granta Books, 2007.
    • A helpful introduction to Montaigne’s thought.
  • Frame, Donald M. Montaigne: A Biography. New York: Harcourt, Brace and World, 1965.
    • A very thorough biography.
  • Friedrich, Hugo. Montaigne. Edited by Philippe Desan. Translated by Dawn Eng. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1991.
    • A landmark work in Montaigne studies; provides a thorough account of both the Essays themselves and the cultural context out of which they emerged.
  • Gauna, Max. Montaigne and the Ethics of Compassion. Lewiston: The Edwin Mellen Press, 2000.
    • A study of Montaigne’s ethics that situates him in the tradition of eudaimonism.
  • Hallie, Philip. The Scar of Montaigne: An Essay in Personal Philosophy. Middletown:  Wesleyan University Press, 1966.
    • An accessible account of Montaigne as a skeptic for whom the practice of philosophy is intimately tied to one’s way of life.
  • Hartle, Ann. Michel de Montaigne: Accidental Philosopher. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • An excellent account of the philosophical nature of Montaigne’s thought.
  • La Charité, Raymond C. The Concept of Judgment in Montaigne. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1968.
    • A superb study of the role that judgment plays in Montaigne’s philosophical project.
  • Langer, Ullrich, ed. The Cambridge Companion to Montaigne. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005.
    • Contains a number of helpful articles by preeminent Montaigne scholars.
  • Levine, Alan. Sensual Philosophy: Toleration, Skepticism, and Montaigne’s Politics of the Self. Lanham: Lexington Books, 2001.
    • Interprets Montaigne as a champion of modern liberal values such as tolerance the protection of a robust private sphere.
  • Nehamas, Alexander.  The Art of Living: Socratic Reflections from Plato to Foucault. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1998.
    • Includes a study of Montaigne’s relationship to Socrates, especially in connection with the essay “Of Physiognomy.”
  • Popkin, Richard. The History of Scepticism from Savonarola to Bayle. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • Interprets Montaigne as a skeptical fideist in the Pyrrhonian tradition.
  • Quint, David. Montaigne and the Quality of Mercy: Ethical and Political Themes in the Essais. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1998.
    • Argues that Montaigne’s primary concern in the Essays is to replace the martial conception of virtue prevalent during his time with a new conception of virtue more conducive to the preservation of public peace.
  • Regosin, Richard. The Matter of My Book: Montaigne’s Essays as the Book of the Self. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1977.
    • A literary study examining the relation between Montaigne’s text and his conception of the self.
  • Sayce, Richard. The Essays of Montaigne: A Critical Exploration. London: Weidenfeld and Nicolson, 1972.
    • A classic comprehensive study of the Essays.
  • Schaefer, David Lewis. The Political Philosophy of Montaigne. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1990.
    • Argues that the Essays are more systematic than they initially appear, and that Montaigne’s primary project in writing them was to transform the political and social orders of his time.
  • Shklar, Judith. Ordinary Vices. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1984.
    • Interprets Montaigne’s ranking of cruelty as the worst vice as both a radical rejection of the religious and political conventions of his time and a foundational moment in the history of liberalism.
  • Starobinski, Jean. Montaigne in Motion. Translated by Arthur Goldhammer. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1985.
    • A postmodern reading the Essays that deals with major themes such as the body, friendship, the public and the private, and death.
  • Taylor, Charles. Sources of the Self: The Making of the Modern Identity. Cambridge, MA:  Harvard University Press, 1989.
    • Situates Montaigne in the history of modern conceptions of the self.

Author Information

Christopher Edelman
University of the Incarnate Word
U. S. A.


Neo-Stoicism (or Neostoicism) is the name given to a late Renaissance philosophical movement that attempted to revive ancient Stoicism in a form that would be acceptable to a Christian audience. This involved the rejection or modification of certain parts of the Stoic system, especially physical doctrines such as materialism and determinism. The key text founding this movement was Justus Lipsius’s De Constantia ("On Constancy") of 1584. After Lipsius the other key exponent of Neostoicism was Guillaume Du Vair. Other figures that have been associated with this movement include Pierre Charron, Francisco de Quevedo, and Michel de Montaigne.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction: The Word 'Neostoicism'
  2. Background: Church Fathers and the Middle Ages
  3. Justus Lipsius (1547-1606) and the Creation of Neostoicism
  4. Selected Neostoics
    1. Guillaume Du Vair (1556-1621)
    2. Pierre Charron (1541-1603)
    3. Francisco de Quevedo (1580-1645)
    4. Michel de Montaigne (1533-1592)
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction: The Word 'Neostoicism'

The term 'Neostoicism' appears to have been coined by Jean Calvin. In his Institutio Religionis Christianae (‘Institutes of the Christian Religion’) of 1536, Calvin made reference to ‘new Stoics’ (novi Stoici) who attempted to revive the ideal of impassivity (apatheia) instead of embracing the properly Christian virtue of heroically enduring suffering sent by God (Inst. 3.8.9). While the true Christian acknowledges the test sent to him by God, these modern ‘Neostoics’ pretend to deny the existence of such suffering altogether.

Whatever its origins, the term 'Neostoicism' has come to refer to the sixteenth and seventeenth century intellectual movement which attempted to revive ancient Stoic philosophy in a form that would be compatible with Christianity. As Calvin’s objection attests, this was often seen by others to be a very difficult, if not impossible, task. It is also important to stress that this attempt was not merely to revive scholarly interest in ancient Stoic thought (although it often involved this as well) but rather to revive Stoicism as a living philosophical movement by which people could lead their lives.

The central figure in the Neostoic movement was Justus Lipsius. Lipsius's De Constantia ('On Constancy’) may be credited as the inspiration for this movement. This work was first published in 1584, well after Calvin’s reference to contemporary ‘Neostoics’. Whomever Calvin had in mind in his polemic, they did not form part of what is now known as the Neostoic movement. The term’s use now reflects modern scholarly classification rather than Renaissance self-description.

2. Background: Church Fathers and the Middle Ages

Attempts to reconcile Stoicism with Christianity are almost as old as Christianity itself. The earliest attempts can be seen in the works of a number of the Latin Church Fathers. St. Augustine showed sympathy towards the Stoic doctrine of apatheia, while Tertullian was drawn towards Stoic pantheistic materialism. However none of these Christian authors wholly endorsed the Stoic philosophical system. Indeed, they often conflicted with regard to which parts of Stoic philosophy they thought could be reconciled with orthodox Christian teaching. Later Neostoics, especially Justus Lipsius, often drew upon the authority of the Church Fathers, citing their endorsements of certain Stoic ideas, but remaining silent about their doubts.

Stoicism continued to exert influence throughout the Christian Middle Ages. Adaptations of Epictetus's Enchiridion ('Handbook’) were made for use in monasteries (references to ‘Socrates’ were altered to ‘St. Paul’), highlighting the perceived affinity between the Christian and the Stoic way of life. Seneca’s Epistulae (‘Letters’) circulated and appear to have been read by many. Stoic ethical ideas can be seen in the moral works of Peter Abelard, especially in the Dialogus inter Philosophum, Iudaeum et Christianum (‘Dialogue Between a Philosopher, a Jew, and Christian’), and his pupil John of Salisbury.

In each of these instances Stoic moral ideas were taken out of the broader context of the Stoic philosophical system and placed with a Christian context. It is sometimes claimed that this practice simply reflected the predominance of moral themes within the available sources, namely the Latin works of Seneca and Cicero. However, at least some knowledge of Stoic physics was readily accessible in works such as Cicero's De Natura Deorum ('On the Nature of the Gods’), De Divinatione (‘On Divination’), and De Fato (‘On Fate’). The existence of a forged correspondence between Seneca and St. Paul, accepted as genuine by St. Augustine and St. Jerome, may well have contributed to the thought that it was possible to combine Stoic ethics with Christian teaching.

In marked contrast, the attempt to revive Stoic pantheistic physics by David of Dinant ended with declarations of heresy and the burning of books. His identification of God with primary matter led to his condemnation in 1210 and he was forced to flee France. Consequently none of his works survive except as brief quotations in the hostile polemics of St. Albert the Great and St. Thomas Aquinas. Although medieval Christian authorities were apparently open to the use of Stoic ethics as a supplement to Christian teaching, they certainly remained suspicious of Stoic physics, which was at best pantheistic and at worst materialist and atheistic.

This, then, was the background to the late Renaissance attempt to revive Stoicism. Stoic ethics was thought to contain much that could be commended to the Christian, but only if carefully disentangled from Stoic physics. In attempting this careful operation, the remarks of the Church Fathers proved to be especially influential. These impeccable Christian authorities could be cited without fear of reproach from the Church.

3. Justus Lipsius (1547-1606) and the Creation of Neostoicism

Although early Renaissance figures such as Petrarch and Politian displayed an interest in and sympathy for Stoic philosophy, the first concerted attempt to resurrect Stoicism as a living philosophical movement must be credited to the Belgian classical philologist and Humanist Justus Lipsius (1547-1606). Lipsius's fame today rests primarily upon his important critical editions of Seneca and Tacitus. While Seneca taught Lipsius some of the details of Stoic doctrine, Tacitus recorded for him that doctrine 'in action’ in the lives of a number of Roman Stoics.

Lipsius's principal philosophical work, De Constantia ('On Constancy’) of 1584, outlines the way in which a Christian may, in times of trouble, draw upon a Stoic inspired ethic of constancy (constantia) in order help him endure the evils of the world. As Lipsius makes clear in a prefatory letter to the work, he was the first to "have attempted the opening and clearing of this way of wisdom [i.e. Stoicism], so long recluded and overgrown with thorns". Yet in order to do this, Lipsius had to present this pagan philosophy in a form that could be reconciled with Christianity. Thus he makes clear in the same letter that it is only in conjunction with holy scriptures (cum divinis litteris conjuncta) that this ancient way of wisdom (Sapientiae viam) can lead to tranquillity and peace (ad Tranquillitatem et Quietem). In particular, Lipsius draws attention to those parts of Stoic philosophy that the devout Christian must reject (Const. 1.20). These are the claims that (a) God is submitted to fate; (b) that there is a natural order of causes (and thus no miracles); (c) that there is no contingency; (d) that there is no free will. All four of these depend upon the Stoic theory of determinism which, in turn, is based upon Stoic materialism.

Another Stoic doctrine that aroused some controversy was the ideal of impassiveness (apatheia). As we have already seen, it was with reference to this notion that Calvin criticised the 'new Stoics' (novi Stoici) of his day. Christian discussion of this Stoic idea dates back at least to St. Augustine who initially appears to have been sympathetic (e.g. De Ordine) but later became more critical. The issue is closely bound with judgements concerning the power of reason. For the Stoics, the wise man or sage (sophos) can overcome all unwanted emotions by rational analysis of his judgements. For a Christian, however, this should only be possible with the help of God’s grace. It is the love of God, rather than the exercise of philosophical reason, that frees the Christian from mental disturbances. This is the position that St. Augustine affirms in his later works (e.g. De Civitate Dei). It is thus possible, using St Augustine alone, to cite a Church Father both for and against this Stoic doctrine.

The Neostoic must be careful here. Lipsius's entire project in De Constantia is primarily philosophical. His concern is to promote rational reflection concerning emotional distress in order overcome it. Following the Stoic Epictetus, Lipsius affirms that the philosopher’s school should be conceived as a doctor’s surgery (Const. 1.10), a place where one can find medicine for the soul. Thus Lipsius affirms the power of philosophical analysis to enable one to overcome the emotions. This conflicts with the attitudes of both the mature St. Augustine and Calvin. Although Neostoicim includes numerous concessions to Christian teaching, this affirmation of the power of reason shows that its philosophical commitment to Stoicism took priority over a strict adherence to the Christian faith. Neostoics were later criticised for precisely this by Christian authors such as Pascal.

Despite these difficulties, Neostoicism could point to the Stoic affirmation of virtue over pleasure (in opposition to unquestionably heretical Epicureanism) and to the Stoic attitude of indifference towards material possessions. Thus it became commonplace for Christians with Neostoic leanings to affirm the benefit that could be gained from the study of Stoic texts. The first translation of Epictetus's Enchiridion ('Handbook’) into English (in 1567) was prefaced with the remark that "the authoure whereof although he were an ethnicke, yet he wrote very godly & christianly". Similarly, a translation of a Neostoic text into English began with the claim that "philosophie in generall is profitable unto a Christian man, if it be well and rightly used: but no kinde of philosophie is more profitable and neerer approaching unto Christianitie than the philosophie of the Stoicks".

4. Selected Neostoics

Neostoicism was never an organized intellectual movement. Thus modern scholars do not always agree upon a fixed list of 'Neostoics'. When used in its most restricted sense, the term is reserved only for Justus Lipsius and Guillaume Du Vair (see below). When used in its widest sense, it is applied to almost any sixteenth or seventeenth century author whose works display the influence of Stoic ideas. The following are some of the more obvious candidates after Lipsius himself.

a. Guillaume Du Vair (1556-1621)

Guillaume Du Vair was a French statesman, onetime clerk councillor to the Paris parliament, and later Bishop of Lisieux. Du Vair was an admirer of Lipsius and produced his own treatise De la Constance ('On Constancy') in 1594. While Lipsius had been inspired by Seneca, Du Vair drew his inspiration from Epictetus. He translated the latter’s Enchiridion (‘Handbook’) into French (c. 1586) and characterized his own treatise, the Philosophie morale de Stoïques (‘Moral Philosophy of the Stoics’), as merely a reconstructed version of the Enchiridion, rewritten and reorganized in order to make its doctrines more accessible to the public.

In Philosophie morale de Stoïques Du Vair treads a very careful path indeed in his attempt to combine Christianity with his admiration for Epictetus. He suggests that, although it would be improper for anyone to prefer the profane and puddle water of the pagan philosophers to the clear and sacred fountain of God's word, nevertheless the Stoics must be acknowledged as the greatest reproach to Christianity, insofar as they managed to live the noblest and most virtuous lives without the true light of the Christian God to guide them.

Following Epictetus, Du Vair argues that one should not concern oneself with external possessions. In particular, he suggests that the desire for great wealth is often the cause of great unhappiness. If one can free oneself from the passions of hope, despair, fear, and anger, then it will become possible to confront the trials and misfortunes of life without any great concern. Of particular interest, however, is the way in which Du Vair synthesises the Stoic doctrine of apatheia with his Christian belief. For Du Vair, complete mastery of one's passions, achieved via the application of Stoic principles, does not contradict Christian teaching but rather can form the basis for a truly Christian way of life. Only one who has overcome the passions of fear and anger can, for instance, practice true Christian forgiveness towards one’s enemies.

b. Pierre Charron (1541-1603)

Pierre Charron was a French churchman and associate of Michel de Montaigne. He has been characterized as a figure in the Pyrrhonist revival and thus as much of a Neosceptic as a Neostoic, if not more so. His principal philosophical work, De la Sagesse ('On Wisdom'), was first published in 1601. This text focuses upon the image of the Stoic ethical ideal, the wise man or sage (sophos), and the task of progressing towards that ideal. It is not merely a treatise on ethics but primarily a guide to the life of wisdom, a guide to ‘making progress’ (prokopê), following the form of Epictetus’s Enchiridion.

In the first book of De la Sagesse Charron focuses upon self-knowledge and self-examination; in the second book he focuses upon behaviour; in the third he outlines the traditional virtues of prudence, justice, fortitude, and temperance. Charron's text was incredibly popular in its day, having appeared in thirty-six editions by 1672. Yet it is less an original treatise and more a compendium of existing material, drawing upon a variety of other authors both ancient and modern. In particular, Charron has often been accused of plagiarising from Montaigne on a grand scale. He also openly acknowledges his debt to Neostoicism. In one of his prefaratory notes, Charron writes that, "this subject has indeed had a great right done to it by Lipsius already, who wrote an excellent treatise, in a method peculiar to himself, but the substance of it you will find all transplanted here" (Sag. 3.2.Pref.). Charron also acknowledges his debt to Du Vair, "to whom I have been much beholding, and from whom have borrowed a great deal of what I shall say upon this subject of the passions" (Sag. 1.18.Pref).

c. Francisco de Quevedo (1580-1645)

Francisco de Quevedo was a Spanish author who held positions at the royal court. He also produced a Spanish translation of Epictetus and a short work entitled Doctrina Estoica ('Stoic Doctrine') which were published together in 1635. The latter work was the second Neostoic text to appear in Spanish, pre-dated only by a translation of Lipsius’s De Constantia, which appeared in 1616. Here, and throughout his works, Quevedo draws upon both Seneca and Epictetus and quotes both of these Stoic authorities often.

In the Doctrina Estoica (the full title is Nombre, Origen, Intento, Recomendación y Descendencia de la Doctrina Estoica) Quevedo attempted to connect Stoic thought with the Bible. Noting that the founder of Stoicism, Zeno, was of Semitic origin, Quevedo claimed that the biblical account of Job's heroic endurance in the face of adversity was the inspiration behind Stoic philosophy. The doctrines of Epictetus are thus, suggests Quevedo, simply formal ethical principles extrapolated from the actions of Job. Yet despite this bold, if untenable, vindication of Stoicism, Quevedo remains wary of calling himself a Stoic. Thus he concludes the essay by saying "I would not myself boast of being a Stoic, but I hold them in high esteem".

d. Michel de Montaigne (1533-1592)

Although it would probably be incorrect to call the famous French essayist Michel de Montaigne a 'Neostoic', nevertheless a Neostoic tendency can certainly be discerned in his work. He certainly admired Justus Lipsius, describing him as one of the most learned men then alive (Essais 2.12). His general admiration of Seneca can be seen in Essai 2.10, ‘On Books’, and is repeated in Essai 2.32, ‘In Defence of Seneca and Plutarch’. In Essai 1.33 he draws attention to a parallel between Seneca and early Christians with regard to their attitudes towards death, while Essai 1.14 is devoted to an explication of a saying by Epictetus (that men are upset not by things, but by their judgements about things). However, Montaigne’s mature view doubted the rational abilities of man and certainly would not have endorsed the ambitious Stoic ideal of the superhuman sage (sophos). Nevertheless he remained drawn to it, writing that, "if a man cannot attain to that noble Stoic impassibility, let him hide in the lap of this peasant insensitivity of mine. What Stoics did from virtue I teach myself to do from temperament" (Essais 3.10). Montaigne’s engagement with Stoicism thus forms an important part of the revival in interest in Stoic philosophy surrounding Neostoicism.

5. Conclusion

Neostoicism was an important intellectual movement at the end of the sixteenth and beginning of the seventeenth centuries. Yet it is little known to many historians of philosophy. The themes with which it dealt can be seen to form the background to a number of themes in seventeenth century philosophy, especially the accounts of the passions in Descartes and Spinoza.

Moreover, the term 'Neostoicism' is useful to refer to Christian authors inspired by Stoic ethical ideas, for ‘Christian Stoicism’ is, strictly speaking, a contradiction in terms. Although Stoicism may be characterized as a pantheist philosophy, it is also a materialist and determinist philosophy. The orthodox Christian can never, at the same time, be a Stoic. However he can admire certain parts of Stoic ethics and the Neostoic movement indicates that in the late Renaissance many indeed did.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Justus Lipsius

The principal text for Neostoicism is Justus Lipsius's De Constantia. It was translated into English a number of times in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries and one of these was reprinted in 1939:

  • Two Bookes Of Constancie, Englished by Sir John Stradling, Edited with an Introduction by Rudolf Kirk (New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press, 1939)

References to other works by Lipsius and studies concerned directly with him can be found at the end of the IEP article Justus Lipsius.

b. Other Neostoics

  • CHARRON, P., De la sagesse livres trois (Bordeaux: Simon Millanges, 1601) and later editions - translated as Of Wisdom, Three Books, Made English by George Stanhope, 2 vols (London, 1697)
  • DU VAIR, G., De la sainte philosophie, Philosophie morale des Stoïques, ed. G. Michaut (Paris: Vrin, 1945) - part translated in The Moral Philosophie of the Stoicks, Englished by Thomas James, Edited by Rudolf Kirk (New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press, 1951)
  • MONTAIGNE, M. de, Essais, ed. F. Strowski, sous les auspices de la commission des archives municipales, 5 vols (Bordeaux: Imprimerie Nouvelle F. Pech, 1906-33) - translated as The Complete Essays, trans. M. A. Screech (Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1991)
  • QUEVEDO, F. de, 'Stoic Doctrine', trans. L. Deitz & A. Wiehe-Deitz, in J. Kraye, ed., Cambridge Translations of Renaissance Philosophical Texts 1: Moral Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), 210-225.

c. Studies of Neostoicism

  • COPENHAVER, B. P., & C. B. SCHMITT, Renaissance Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992)
  • ETTINGHAUSEN, H., Francisco de Quevedo and the Neostoic Movement (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1972)
  • LAGRÉE, J., Juste Lipse et la restauration du stoïcisme: Étude et traduction des traités stoïciens De la constance, Manuel de philosophie stoïcienne, Physique des stoïciens (Paris: Vrin, 1994)
  • MOREAU, J.-P., ed., Le stoïcisme au XVIe et au XVIIe siècle (Paris: Albin Michel, 1999)
  • MORFORD, M., Stoics and Neostoics: Rubens and the Circle of Lipsius (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1991)
  • OESTREICH, G., Neostoicism and the Early Modern State, trans. D. McLintock (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982)
  • ZANTA, L., La renaissance du stoïcisme au XVIe siècle (Paris: Champion, 1914)
  • d. Further Studies Dealing with the Influence of Stoicism

  • COLISH, M. L., The Stoic Tradition from Antiquity to the Early Middle Ages, 2 vols (Leiden: Brill, 1985; rev. edn 1990)
  • LAPIDGE, M., 'The Stoic Inheritance', in P. Dronke, ed., A History of Twelfth-Century Western Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988), 81-112.
  • OSLER, M. J., ed., Atoms, Pneuma, and Tranquillity: Epicurean and Stoic Themes in European Thought (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991)
  • REYNOLDS, L. D., The Medieval Tradition of Seneca's Letters (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1965)
  • SPANNEUT, M., Le Stoïcisme des Pères de l'Église: De Clément de Rome à Clément d’Alexandrie (Paris: Seuil, 1957)
  • SPANNEUT, M. Permanence du Stoïcisme: De Zénon à Malraux (Gembloux: Duculot, 1973)
  • VERBEKE, G., The Presence of Stoicism in Medieval Thought (Washington: The Catholic University of America Press, 1983)

Author Information

John Sellars
Email: john.sellars (at)
University of the West of England
United Kingdom

John Calvin (1509—1564)

calvinOne can scarcely imagine a figure with a greater reputation for disapproval of philosophy than John Calvin. The French expatriate penned some of the most vitriolic diatribes against philosophy and its role in scholastic theology ever written. Thus, in one way, this reputation is rather well-earned, and an article upon Calvin in an encyclopedia of philosophy can be rather brief. However, in another way, Calvin's consideration, knowledge, and use of philosophy in his own work refutes the obscurantist representation left by a surface-level reading. A closer reading of Calvin's great work, the Institutes of the Christian Religion, along with his commentaries and treatises demonstrates that instead of denying the importance of philosophy, Calvin generally seeks to set philosophy in what he regards as its proper place. His vehemence stems from his belief that the rationalism of some of the scholastics had displaced God's wisdom, most securely found in the work of the Holy Spirit in the scriptures, as the pinnacle for knowledge of the divine.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Philosophy
    1. Knowledge of Philosophy
    2. Epistemology
    3. Influence
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

John Calvin, (1509-1564) was born in Noyon, the son of a notary, Gerard Cauvin, and his wife, Jeanne LeFranc. Although Calvin's father displayed no particular piety, his mother is recorded as having taken him to visit shrines, and on one such occasion he is supposed to have kissed a fragment of the head of St. Ann. Calvin was the fourth of five sons in a family that was definitely not of the aristocracy. Normally, this would have worked against his chances of receiving a thorough education,but through the good fortune of his father's professional relationship to a family of the local nobility, he received a private education with that family's children. Having distinguished himself at an early age, Calvin was deemed worthy of receiving the support of a benefice, a church-granted stipend, at the age of 12, so as to support him in his studies. Although normally benefices were granted as payment for work for the church, either present or in the future, there is no record that Calvin ever performed any duties for this position. Later on he held two more benefices, for which he also did no work. Thus supported by the Church, at age 14, Calvin was enrolled at the College de la Marche in the University of Paris, though he quickly transferred to the College de Montaigu.

In Paris, Calvin first came into contact with the new humanistic learning while preparing for a career as a priest,. Though all the contacts which Calvin made cannot be traced, it seems clear that he met many of the leading humanists of his day. Calvin earned his masters degree at the age of 18. However, he did not proceed with his original plan to prepare for a clerical career. Gerard Cauvin, recently excommunicated in a dispute with the cathedral chapter at Noyon, ordered his son to enroll instead at Orleans in the law faculty. Calvin obeyed, and applied himself, finishing his doctorate in law sometime before 14 January 1532. In that same year, his first published book appeared, a commentary on Seneca's De Clementia. Significantly, it contains no overt evidence of an awareness of, let alone a preoccupation with, the contemporary events in the religious world.

Around 1533, Calvin experienced a "subita conversione," a sudden conversion. As Calvin is notoriously reticent about revealing his personal life, his writings do not grant much insight as to the exact time or cause of this event. Ganoczy relates it to the prosecution of Cop for heresy, during which Calvin fled Paris, and at which time his apartment was searched and his papers confiscated. In any case, on May 4, 1534, he appeared in Noyon, and surrendered his clerical benefices. Probably from that point on, Calvin no longer had a personal attachment to the church of Rome.

Writing rapidly, Calvin finished the first edition of his Institutes of the Christian Religion in 1536. It enjoyed a wide popular demand, and the original supply was exhausted within a year. Instead of simply reprinting it, Calvin revised it, and the edition of 1539 expanded substantially the original work. This would be Calvin's pattern throughout the subsequent Latin editions of 1543, 1550, and 1559. French editions were printed in 1545 and 1560, and Calvin's French is easily as influential as Luther's German for the formation of the modern vernacular. Each Latin edition was a rearrangement of earlier material, as well as the addition of new components. If this had been the sole gift from Calvin's pen, it might seem enough. But Calvin also wrote commentaries on almost every book of the Bible, issued numerous tracts, and preached almost every day in Geneva.

Geneva was to be Calvin's triumph and tribulation. In 1536, Guillaume Farel shamed Calvin into sharing the leadership of Geneva. This period of Calvin's life lasted until the city council threw him out in April of 1538. Calvin was too rigid for their taste. He settled in Strasbourg, and pastored a congregation. It was here that he began his other life work: commenting upon the books of the Bible. Beginning with the Romans commentary, written at least partially and published in Strasbourg in 1540, Calvin would comment upon most of the books of the scripture. However, Geneva called him back in 1541. Calvin, believing that Geneva was his particular call, returned. He was to live there, alternately supporting and berating the council, until his death in 1564. It was in this period that Calvin made his other great contribution to the Church, preparing, and then forcing the city council to ratify, his Ecclesiastical Ordinances of the Church of Geneva. In this, all the principles of Reformed polity are found. In 1564, debilitated by a series of illnesses, Calvin died in Geneva. By the terms of his will, he was buried in an unmarked grave, so as to avoid any possibility of idolatry.

Calvin's thought is marked by a constant dialectic between the perspective of a wholly pure and good creator (God) and the corrupted created being (humanity). His anthropology and soteriology shows his dependence on Augustine, with the will being somewhat limited in human application, and powerless to effect change in its status vis-à-vis salvation. However, Calvin balances that with a hearty emphasis on human response to God's love and mercy in the created order, by correct action both in the human world and the world of nature.

2. Philosophy

a. Knowledge of Philosophy

Given Calvin's occasional antipathy for philosophers, it is all too tempting to dismiss him as someone who knew very little philosophy, striking out at that which he did not know. However tempting that may be, it simply is untrue. In the Institutes, his treatises, and the commentaries, Calvin continually demonstrates a familiarity with both general and specific philosophical knowledge which seems to have been gained through his own study of their writings. What seems most significant about Calvin's use of philosophy is that in general, he refuses to accept a philosophical system. Instead, he considers philosophy as the history of human wisdom's attempt to search out answers to the questions of human existence. Thus, philosophers and their theories become paradigms for consideration, rather than structures for the organization of thought.

Hence, Calvin's effort at using philosophy must be understood as part of his humanism, rather than a tool of the coherence of systematization of his thought. Calvin placed logic in the curriculum of the Genevan Academy. He could illustrate faith with the four-fold causality of Aristotle. He can use the thoughts of the philosophers as aids to training the mind, and believed that not many pastors, and certainly no doctor of the church could be ignorant of philosophy. However, that respect lived in constant tension with his irritation at the efforts of philosophy (and philosophers) at exceeding their proper place.

b. Epistemology

As noted, Calvin can seem overly harsh about philosophy. Concerning the knowledge of God, Calvin states that it is at this point that it becomes clear "how volubly has the whole tribe of philosophers shown their stupidity and silliness! For even though we may excuse the others (who act like utter fools), Plato, the most religious of all and the most circumspect, also vanishes in his round globe." (Institutes of Christian Religion I.v.11) Calvin finds that even the most wise philosophers do not compare to the "sacred reading," which has within itself the power to move the very heart of the reader. (ICR I.viii.1) The power of the scripture is that it carries the gospel, ensured by the Holy Spirit's presence, so that its words can transport the soul. God's purpose, Calvin states, in the scriptural teaching of his infinite and spiritual essence, is to refute even subtle speculations of secular philosophy. (ICR I.viii.1) Even those who have attained the intellectual first rank, cannot reach the eminence which is natural to the Gospel. (Commentary on I Corinthians 2.7).

However, Calvin is not anti-philosophical, hating the works of philosophers and philosophy in general. If so, would he have required logic in the Genevan Academy? Rather, he wished to turn the question of wisdom and philosophy clearly towards obedience to Christ. Thus, in the commentary on I Corinthians, Calvin writes that

"For whatever knowledge and understanding a man has counts for nothing unless it rests upon true wisdom; and it is of no more value for grasping spiritual teaching than the eye of a blind man for distinguishing colours. Both of these must be carefully attended to, that (1) knowledge of all the sciences is so much smoke apart from the heavenly science of Christ; and (2) that man with all his shrewdness is as stupid about understanding by himself the mysteries of God as an ass is incapable of understanding musical harmony."

The interesting point about this passage is that Calvin is neither denigrating human philosophy, nor human reason. He is, rather, discussing what the true purpose of that knowledge or understanding should be, and what the real foundation of human knowledge is. Here, Calvin is not moving back to an Aristotelian self-evident principle; his foundation is instead true wisdom. For Calvin, the phrase "true wisdom" (vera sapientia) hearkens immediately to the beginning sentence of the Institutes. (ICR I.i.1) It was that basis of "true and sound wisdom" (vera ac solida sapientia) which Calvin was seeking, the only place from which epistemology could be safely grounded. Reason, and the fruits of reason, have their place. However, that place does not command a privilege over revealed wisdom.

This instrumental view allows Calvin to give high praise to the fruits of reason. Human reason can even occasionally ascend to consider the truths which are more properly above its grasp, but cannot provide the necessary controls to make sure that its investigations are carefully and correctly considered. "Reason is intelligent enough to taste something of things above, although it is more careless about investigating these." (ICR II.ii.13). Calvin divides reason, giving it various depths of penetration according to its subject matter. He could write "this then, is the distinction: that there is one kind of understanding of earthly things; another of heavenly. I call 'earthly things' those which do not pertain to God or his Kingdom, to true justice, or to the blessedness of the future life; but which have their significance and relationship with regard to the present life and are, in a sense, confined within its bounds." (ICR II.ii.13)

Thus, Calvin is simply fulfilling his own division when he comments from I Corinthians 3 that "The apostle does not ask us to make a total surrender of the wisdom which is either innate or acquired by long experience. He only asks that we subjugate it to God, so that all our wisdom might be derived from His Word." (Commentary on I Corinthians 3.18). Calvin is wishing, quite explicitly, to consider the various arts as maid-servants. He cautions against making them mistresses.

There can be no doubt that Calvin made this move for at least two reasons. The first is that for Calvin, the effects of sin are far more drastic than for some other Christian thinkers. Sin has corrupted not only the will, but also the intellect. After the introduction of sin into the world, human possibility is radically limited, and no un-aided intellect, not even the sharpest, will be able to penetrate into the mysteries of God's truth and God’s current will for humanity.

As important as that insight is another which many have failed to grasp. Calvin's theology involves a radical notion of God’s accommodation to human capacity, or more truly, human frailty. Even before the Fall, humans were only able to know God because of God's self-disclosure; humans were only able to please God because of God’s prior guidance in the form of rules. There was never a moment when humans were able truly to initiate either the knowledge of God or the movement toward God. That is immeasurably more true after the establishment of sin in the world, and its effects. Calvin thus dismisses all efforts at going beyond the scriptures (and a great deal of classical metaphysics), as pure speculation, both wrong and sinful.

c. Influence

Perhaps strangely, Calvin's legacy on the subordinate position of philosophy in the search for divine truth is neither clear, nor lasting. During his own lifetime, Genevan theologians such as Theodore Beza were far more sanguine about grasping the tools of scholastic theology and philosophy, and seem to have been moving away from that hierarchy upon which Calvin insisted. Within the next century, some of the foremost Protestant scholastic theologians would teach at the Genevan Academy, or at least have their ideas taught there.

A modern theological and historiographical struggle exists over what that change entails, and what its significance must be. Some, like Brian G. Armstrong, have argued that this shift towards scholastic models of thought represent an inevitable shift in the content of Reformed theology, and thus a falling away from Calvin's theological project. Others, notably Richard Muller, have contended that there was not an original time without scholastic theology, and that scholastic method is content neutral. In any case, what is clear is that by the mid-17th century, the caution which Calvin so frequently expressed about the use of philosophy, had been lost. With its loss came the loss of Calvin's distinctive appropriation of philosophy.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Opera Quae Supersunt Omnia. 59 volumes. Edited by Wilhelm Baum, Edward Cunitz, & Edward Reuss. Brunswick: Schwetschke and Sons, 1895.
    • Still the standard edition of Calvin's works.
  • Opera Selecta. 5 volumes. 3rd ed. Edited by Peter Barth and Wilhelm Niesel. Munich: Christian Kaiser, 1967.
    • Almost as frequently cited as the Calvini Opera.
  • Ioannis Calvini Opera Exegetica. Various editors. Geneva: Droz, 1992-.
    • This represents a modern effort to provide true critical editions of Calvin's exegetical works, the first volumes present fine texts.
  • Registres du Consistoire de Genève au Temps de Calvin. Tome I (1542-1544). Edited by Thomas A. Lambert and Isabella M. Watt. Geneva: Droz, 1996.
    • Along with later volumes, this allows a far greater contextualization of Calvin than previously possible.
  • Institutes of the Christian Religion. 2 volumes. Translated by Ford Lewis Battles, edited by John T. McNeill. Library of Christian Classics. Philadelphia: Westminster Press, 1960.
    • The standard English translation of Calvin's final Latin edition of the Institutes.
  • Calvin's Commentaries, translated by the Calvin Translation Society, 1843-1855; reprint, Grand Rapids, Michigan: Baker, 1979, 22 volumes.
    • A usable translation of Calvin's commentaries.
  • Calvin's New Testament Commentaries, 12 volumes. Edited by David W. Torrance and Thomas F. Torrance. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1960.
    • Probably the most widely read edition of Calvin's New Testament commentaries.
  • Calvin's Old Testament Commentaries, Rutherford House Translation, ed. D. F. Wright. Grand Rapids, Michigan: Eerdmans, 1993-.
    • A fine new translation of Calvin's Old Testament Commentaries.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Bieler, Andre. The Social Humanism of Calvin. Translated by Paul T. Fuhrmann. Richmond: John Knox Press, 1961.
    • An important work on Calvin's social ethic.
  • Bouwsma, William. John Calvin: A Sixteenth Century Portrait. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1988.
    • A widely cited, controversial reconstruction of Calvin's thought from a psychological framework.
  • Breen, Quirinus. John Calvin: A Study in French Humanism. 2nd ed. New York: Archon Books, 1968.
    • A helpful engagement of Calvin's work as humanism.
  • Cottret, Bernard. Calvin: A Biography. Translated by M. Wallace McDonald. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 2000.
    • The newest biography of Calvin, written from a historian's viewpoint, and supplying rich contextual detail for consideration of Calvin's influences.
  • Davis, Thomas J. The Clearest Promises of God: The Development of Calvin's Eucharistic Teaching. New York: AMS Press, 1995.
    • The clearest setting out of Calvin's eucharistic teaching and its development.
  • Dowey, Edward A. Jr. The Knowledge of God in Calvin's Theology. 3rd ed. Grand Rapids, MI: Wm. B. Eerdmans, 1994.
    • Essentially unchanged from its appearance in 1952, still indispensable for its categories and its vital grasp of the Reformer's thought.
  • Gamble, Richard C. Articles on Calvin and Calvinism, 9 vols. New York: Garland Publishing Co., 1992.
    • Gathers together most of the significant articles on Calvin, other fine collections exist, but this is the most comprehensive.
  • Ganoczy, Alexandre. The Young Calvin. Translated by David Foxgrover and Wade Provo. Philadelphia: Westminster Press, 1987.
    • The best biography and tracing of Calvin's early influences.
  • Kingdon, Robert. Geneva and the Coming of the Wars of Religion in France, 1555-1563. Geneve: Librairie E. Droz, 1956.
    • This seminal work demonstrated the importance of solid historical work to undergird any effort at understanding Calvin's world.
  • McGrath, Alister E. A Life of John Calvin: A Study in the Shaping of Western Culture. Cambridge, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 1990.
    • A standard biography of Calvin.
  • Millet, Olivier. Calvin et la dynamique de la parole: Etude de Rhétorique réformée. Geneve: Editions Slatkine: 1992.
    • Not yet translated, but too important to leave off the list - this magisterial work opens new vistas of research into rhetoric, the early use of theological French, and Calvin's linguistic skills.
  • Muller, Richard. The Unaccommodated Calvin: Studies in the Foundation of a Theological Tradition. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • A conscious effort at returning Calvin studies toward the texts and thought-worlds of the sixteenth century.
  • Naphy, William. Calvin and the Consolidation of the Genevan Reformation. Manchester: Manchester University Press, 1994.
    • One of the best works for understanding Calvin's Geneva.
  • Parker, T.H.L. Calvin's New Testament Commentaries. 2nd ed. Louisville: Westminster/John Knox Press, 1993.
  • Calvin's Old Testament Commentaries. Edinburgh: T. & T. Clark, 1986.
    • Together, these two volumes serve as a fine introduction to Calvin's major life work - the exposition of the scripture.
  • Partee, Charles. Calvin and Classical Philosophy. Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1977.
    • Probably the best place to begin in considering Calvin's knowledge of Greek and Latin philosophy.
  • Schreiner, Susan E. The Theater of His Glory: Nature and the Natural Order in the Thought of John Calvin. Studies in Historical Theology. Durham: Labyrinth Press, 1991.
    • The best textually-argued source for considering Calvin's appropriation of the created order.
  • Steinmetz, David. Calvin in Context Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.
    • This set of essays argues convincingly for understanding Calvin always within the stream of tradition he inherited.
  • Thompson, John. The Daughters of Sarah: Women in Regular and Exceptional Roles in the Exegesis of Calvin, His Predecessors, and His Contemporaries. Geneve: Librairie Droz, 1992.
    • Demonstrates the promise of considering new questions through solid history of exegetical models.
  • Wendel, François. Calvin: Origins and Development of His Religious Thought. Translated by Philip Mairet. Durham, NC: Labyrinth Press, 1987.
    • Originally published in 1963, this introduction is still widely cited.
  • Zachman, Randall C. The Assurance of Faith: Conscience in the Theology of Martin Luther and John Calvin. Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 1993.
    • A sensitive study of how the different grasp of a critical concept led to quite different outcomes in the thought of two giants of the Reformation.

Author Information:

R. Ward Holder
Assistant Professor of Theology
St. Anselm College
U. S. A.

Francis Bacon (1561—1626)

bacon-francisSir Francis Bacon (later Lord Verulam and the Viscount St. Albans) was an English lawyer, statesman, essayist, historian, intellectual reformer, philosopher, and champion of modern science. Early in his career he claimed “all knowledge as his province” and afterwards dedicated himself to a wholesale revaluation and re-structuring of traditional learning. To take the place of the established tradition (a miscellany of Scholasticism, humanism, and natural magic), he proposed an entirely new system based on empirical and inductive principles and the active development of new arts and inventions, a system whose ultimate goal would be the production of practical knowledge for “the use and benefit of men” and the relief of the human condition.

At the same time that he was founding and promoting this new project for the advancement of learning, Bacon was also moving up the ladder of state service. His career aspirations had been largely disappointed under Elizabeth I, but with the ascension of James his political fortunes rose. Knighted in 1603, he was then steadily promoted to a series of offices, including Solicitor General (1607), Attorney General (1613), and eventually Lord Chancellor (1618). While serving as Chancellor, he was indicted on charges of bribery and forced to leave public office. He then retired to his estate where he devoted himself full time to his continuing literary, scientific, and philosophical work. He died in 1626, leaving behind a cultural legacy that, for better or worse, includes most of the foundation for the triumph of technology and for the modern world as we currently know it.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Political Career
  2. Thought and Writings
    1. Literary Works
    2. The New Atlantis
    3. Scientific and Philosophical Works
    4. The Great Instauration
    5. The Advancement of Learning
    6. The “Distempers” of Learning
    7. The Idea of Progress
    8. The Reclassification of Knowledge
    9. The New Organon
    10. The Idols
    11. Induction
  3. Reputation and Cultural Legacy
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Political Career

Sir Francis Bacon (later Lord Verulam, the Viscount St. Albans, and Lord Chancellor of England) was born in London in 1561 to a prominent and well-connected family. His parents were Sir Nicholas Bacon, the Lord Keeper of the Seal, and Lady Anne Cooke, daughter of Sir Anthony Cooke, a knight and one-time tutor to the royal family. Lady Anne was a learned woman in her own right, having acquired Greek and Latin as well as Italian and French. She was a sister-in-law both to Sir Thomas Hoby, the esteemed English translator of Castiglione, and to Sir William Cecil (later Lord Burghley), Lord Treasurer, chief counselor to Elizabeth I, and from 1572-1598 the most powerful man in England.

Bacon was educated at home at the family estate at Gorhambury in Herfordshire. In 1573, at the age of just twelve, he entered Trinity College, Cambridge, where the stodgy Scholastic curriculum triggered his lifelong opposition to Aristotelianism (though not to the works of Aristotle himself).

In 1576 Bacon began reading law at Gray’s Inn. Yet only a year later he interrupted his studies in order to take a position in the diplomatic service in France as an assistant to the ambassador. In 1579, while he was still in France, his father died, leaving him (as the second son of a second marriage and the youngest of six heirs) virtually without support. With no position, no land, no income, and no immediate prospects, he returned to England and resumed the study of law.

Bacon completed his law degree in 1582, and in 1588 he was named lecturer in legal studies at Gray’s Inn. In the meantime, he was elected to Parliament in 1584 as a member for Melcombe in Dorsetshire. He would remain in Parliament as a representative for various constituencies for the next 36 years.

In 1593 his blunt criticism of a new tax levy resulted in an unfortunate setback to his career expectations, the Queen taking personal offense at his opposition. Any hopes he had of becoming Attorney General or Solicitor General during her reign were dashed, though Elizabeth eventually relented to the extent of appointing Bacon her Extraordinary Counsel in 1596.

It was around this time that Bacon entered the service of Robert Devereux, the Earl of Essex, a dashing courtier, soldier, plotter of intrigue, and sometime favorite of the Queen. No doubt Bacon viewed Essex as a rising star and a figure who could provide a much-needed boost to his own sagging career. Unfortunately, it was not long before Essex’s own fortunes plummeted following a series of military and political blunders culminating in a disastrous coup attempt. When the coup plot failed, Devereux was arrested, tried, and eventually executed, with Bacon, in his capacity as Queen’s Counsel, playing a vital role in the prosecution of the case.

In 1603, James I succeeded Elizabeth, and Bacon’s prospects for advancement dramatically improved. After being knighted by the king, he swiftly ascended the ladder of state and from 1604-1618 filled a succession of high-profile advisory positions:

  • 1604 – Appointed King’s Counsel.
  • 1607 – Named Solicitor General.
  • 1608 – Appointed Clerk of the Star Chamber.
  • 1613 – Appointed Attorney General.
  • 1616 – Made a member of the Privy Council.
  • 1617 – Appointed Lord Keeper of the Royal Seal (his father’s former office).
  • 1618 – Made Lord Chancellor.

As Lord Chancellor, Bacon wielded a degree of power and influence that he could only have imagined as a young lawyer seeking preferment. Yet it was at this point, while he stood at the very pinnacle of success, that he suffered his great Fall. In 1621 he was arrested and charged with bribery. After pleading guilty, he was heavily fined and sentenced to a prison term in the Tower of London. Although the fine was later waived and Bacon spent only four days in the Tower, he was never allowed to sit in Parliament or hold political office again.

The entire episode was a terrible disgrace for Bacon personally and a stigma that would cling to and injure his reputation for years to come. As various chroniclers of the case have pointed out, the accepting of gifts from suppliants in a law suit was a common practice in Bacon’s day, and it is also true that Bacon ended up judging against the two petitioners who had offered the fateful bribes. Yet the damage was done, and Bacon to his credit accepted the judgment against him without excuse. According to his own Essayes, or Counsels, he should have known and done better. (In this respect it is worth noting that during his forced retirement, Bacon revised and republished the Essayes, injecting an even greater degree of shrewdness into a collection already notable for its worldliness and keen political sense.) Macaulay in a lengthy essay declared Bacon a great intellect but (borrowing a phrase from Bacon’s own letters) a “most dishonest man,” and more than one writer has characterized him as cold, calculating, and arrogant. Yet whatever his flaws, even his enemies conceded that during his trial he accepted his punishment nobly, and moved on.

Bacon spent his remaining years working with renewed determination on his lifelong project: the reform of learning and the establishment of an intellectual community dedicated to the discovery of scientific knowledge for the “use and benefit of men.” The former Lord Chancellor died on 9 April, 1626, supposedly of a cold or pneumonia contracted while testing his theory of the preservative and insulating properties of snow.

2. Thought and Writings

In a way Bacon’s descent from political power was a fortunate fall, for it represented a liberation from the bondage of public life resulting in a remarkable final burst of literary and scientific activity. As Renaissance scholar and Bacon expert Brian Vickers has reminded us, Bacon’s earlier works, impressive as they are, were essentially products of his “spare time.” It was only during his last five years that he was able to concentrate exclusively on writing and produce, in addition to a handful of minor pieces:

  • Two substantial volumes of history and biography, The History of the Reign of King Henry the Seventh and The History of the Reign of King Henry the Eighth.
  • De Augmentis Scientiarum (an expanded Latin version of his earlier Advancement of Learning).
  • The final 1625 edition of his Essayes, or Counsels.
  • The remarkable Sylva Sylvarum, or A Natural History in Ten Centuries (a curious hodge-podge of scientific experiments, personal observations, speculations, ancient teachings, and analytical discussions on topics ranging from the causes of hiccups to explanations for the shortage of rain in Egypt). Artificially divided into ten “centuries” (that is, ten chapters, each consisting of one hundred items), the work was apparently intended to be included in Part Three of the Magna Instauratio.
  • His utopian science-fiction novel The New Atlantis, which was published in unfinished form a year after his death.
  • Various parts of his unfinished magnum opus Magna Instauratio (or Great Instauration), including a “Natural History of Winds” and a “Natural History of Life and Death.”

These late productions represented the capstone of a writing career that spanned more than four decades and encompassed virtually an entire curriculum of literary, scientific, and philosophical studies.

a. Literary Works

Despite the fanatical claims (and very un-Baconian credulity) of a few admirers, it is a virtual certainty that Bacon did not write the works traditionally attributed to William Shakespeare. Even so, the Lord Chancellor’s high place in the history of English literature as well as his influential role in the development of English prose style remain well-established and secure. Indeed even if Bacon had produced nothing else but his masterful Essayes (first published in 1597 and then revised and expanded in 1612 and 1625), he would still rate among the top echelon of 17th-century English authors. And so when we take into account his other writings, e.g., his histories, letters, and especially his major philosophical and scientific works, we must surely place him in the first rank of English literature’s great men of letters and among its finest masters (alongside names like Johnson, Mill, Carlyle, and Ruskin) of non-fiction prose.

Bacon’s style, though elegant, is by no means as simple as it seems or as it is often described. In fact it is actually a fairly complex affair that achieves its air of ease and clarity more through its balanced cadences, natural metaphors, and carefully arranged symmetries than through the use of plain words, commonplace ideas, and straightforward syntax. (In this connection it is noteworthy that in the revised versions of the essays Bacon seems to have deliberately disrupted many of his earlier balanced effects to produce a style that is actually more jagged and, in effect, more challenging to the casual reader.)

Furthermore, just as Bacon’s personal style and living habits were prone to extravagance and never particularly austere, so in his writing he was never quite able to resist the occasional grand word, magniloquent phrase, or orotund effect. (As Dr. Johnson observed, “A dictionary of the English language might be compiled from Bacon’s works alone.”) Bishop Sprat in his 1667 History of the Royal Society honored Bacon and praised the society membership for supposedly eschewing fine words and fancy metaphors and adhering instead to a natural lucidity and “mathematical plainness.” To write in such a way, Sprat suggested, was to follow true, scientific, Baconian principles. And while Bacon himself often expressed similar sentiments (praising blunt expression while condemning the seductions of figurative language), a reader would be hard pressed to find many examples of such spare technique in Bacon’s own writings. Of Bacon’s contemporary readers, at least one took exception to the view that his writing represented a perfect model of plain language and transparent meaning. After perusing the New Organon, King James (to whom Bacon had proudly dedicated the volume) reportedly pronounced the work “like the peace of God, which passeth all understanding.”

b. The New Atlantis

As a work of narrative fiction, Bacon’s novel New Atlantis may be classified as a literary rather than a scientific (or philosophical) work, though it effectively belongs to both categories. According to Bacon’s amanuensis and first biographer William Rawley, the novel represents the first part (showing the design of a great college or institute devoted to the interpretation of nature) of what was to have been a longer and more detailed project (depicting the entire legal structure and political organization of an ideal commonwealth). The work thus stands in the great tradition of the utopian-philosophical novel that stretches from Plato and More to Huxley and Skinner.

The thin plot or fable is little more than a fictional shell to contain the real meat of Bacon’s story: the elaborate description of Salomon’s House (also known as the College of the Six Days Works), a centrally organized research facility where specially trained teams of investigators collect data, conduct experiments, and (most importantly from Bacon’s point of view) apply the knowledge they gain to produce “things of use and practice for man’s life.” These new arts and inventions they eventually share with the outside world.

In terms of its sci-fi adventure elements, the New Atlantis is about as exciting as a government or university re-organization plan. But in terms of its historical impact, the novel has proven to be nothing less than revolutionary, having served not only as an effective inspiration and model for the British Royal Society, but also as an early blueprint and prophecy of the modern research center and international scientific community.

c. Scientific and Philosophical Works

It is never easy to summarize the thought of a prolific and wide-ranging philosopher. Yet Bacon somewhat simplifies the task by his own helpful habits of systematic classification and catchy mnemonic labeling. (Thus, for example, there are three “distempers” – or diseases – of learning,” eleven errors or “peccant humours,” four “Idols,” three primary mental faculties and categories of knowledge, etc.) In effect, by following Bacon’s own methods it is possible to produce a convenient outline or overview of his main scientific and philosophical ideas.

d. The Great Instauration

As early as 1592, in a famous letter to his uncle, Lord Burghley, Bacon declared “all knowledge” to be his province and vowed his personal commitment to a plan for the full-scale rehabilitation and reorganization of learning. In effect, he dedicated himself to a long-term project of intellectual reform, and the balance of his career can be viewed as a continuing effort to make good on that pledge. In 1620, while he was still at the peak of his political success, he published the preliminary description and plan for an enormous work that would fully answer to his earlier declared ambitions. The work, dedicated to James, was to be called Magna Instauratio (that is, the “grand edifice” or Great Instauration), and it would represent a kind of summa or culmination of all Bacon’s thought on subjects ranging from logic and epistemology to practical science (or what in Bacon’s day was called “natural philosophy,” the word science being then but a general synonym for “wisdom” or “learning”).

Like several of Bacon’s projects, the Instauratio in its contemplated form was never finished. Of the intended six parts, only the first two were completed, while the other portions were only partly finished or barely begun. Consequently, the work as we have it is less like the vast but well-sculpted monument that Bacon envisioned than a kind of philosophical miscellany or grab-bag. Part I of the project, De Dignitate et Augmentis Scientiarum (“Nine Books of the Dignity and Advancement of Learning”), was published in 1623. It is basically an enlarged version of the earlier Proficience and Advancement of Learning, which Bacon had presented to James in 1605. Part II, the Novum Organum (or “New Organon”) provides the author’s detailed explanation and demonstration of the correct procedure for interpreting nature. It first appeared in 1620. Together these two works present the essential elements of Bacon’s philosophy, including most of the major ideas and principles that we have come to associate with the terms “Baconian” and “Baconianism.”

e. The Advancement of Learning

Relatively early in his career Bacon judged that, owing mainly to an undue reverence for the past (as well as to an excessive absorption in cultural vanities and frivolities), the intellectual life of Europe had reached a kind of impasse or standstill. Yet he believed there was a way beyond this stagnation if persons of learning, armed with new methods and insights, would simply open their eyes and minds to the world around them. This at any rate was the basic argument of his seminal 1605 treatise The Proficience and Advancement of Learning, arguably the first important philosophical work to be published in English.

It is in this work that Bacon sketched out the main themes and ideas that he continued to refine and develop throughout his career, beginning with the notion that there are clear obstacles to or diseases of learning that must be avoided or purged before further progress is possible.

f. The “Distempers” of Learning

“There be therefore chiefly three vanities in studies, whereby learning hath been most traduced.” Thus Bacon, in the first book of the Advancement. He goes on to refer to these vanities as the three “distempers” of learning and identifies them (in his characteristically memorable fashion) as “fantastical learning,” “contentious learning,” and “delicate learning” (alternatively identified as “vain imaginations,” “vain altercations,” and “vain affectations”).

By fantastical learning (“vain imaginations”) Bacon had in mind what we would today call pseudo-science: i.e., a collection of ideas that lack any real or substantial foundation, that are professed mainly by occultists and charlatans, that are carefully shielded from outside criticism, and that are offered largely to an audience of credulous true believers. In Bacon’s day such “imaginative science” was familiar in the form of astrology, natural magic, and alchemy.

By contentious learning (“vain altercations”) Bacon was referring mainly to Aristotelian philosophy and theology and especially to the Scholastic tradition of logical hair-splitting and metaphysical quibbling. But the phrase applies to any intellectual endeavor in which the principal aim is not new knowledge or deeper understanding but endless debate cherished for its own sake.

Delicate learning (“vain affectations”) was Bacon’s label for the new humanism insofar as (in his view) it seemed concerned not with the actual recovery of ancient texts or the retrieval of past knowledge but merely with the revival of Ciceronian rhetorical embellishments and the reproduction of classical prose style. Such preoccupation with “words more than matter,” with “choiceness of phrase” and the “sweet falling of clauses” – in short, with style over substance – seemed to Bacon (a careful stylist in his own right) the most seductive and decadent literary vice of his age.

Here we may note that from Bacon’s point of view the “distempers” of learning share two main faults:

  1. Prodigal ingenuity – i.e., each distemper represents a lavish and regrettable waste of talent, as inventive minds that might be employed in more productive pursuits exhaust their energy on trivial or puerile enterprises instead.
  2. Sterile results – i.e., instead of contributing to the discovery of new knowledge (and thus to a practical “advancement of learning” and eventually to a better life for all), the distempers of learning are essentially exercises in personal vainglory that aim at little more than idle theorizing or the preservation of older forms of knowledge.

In short, in Bacon’s view the distempers impede genuine intellectual progress by beguiling talented thinkers into fruitless, illusory, or purely self-serving ventures. What is needed – and this is a theme reiterated in all his later writings on learning and human progress – is a program to re-channel that same creative energy into socially useful new discoveries.

g. The Idea of Progress

Though it is hard to pinpoint the birth of an idea, for all intents and purposes the modern idea of technological “progress” (in the sense of a steady, cumulative, historical advance in applied scientific knowledge) began with Bacon’s The Advancement of Learning and became fully articulated in his later works.

Knowledge is power, and when embodied in the form of new technical inventions and mechanical discoveries it is the force that drives history – this was Bacon’s key insight. In many respects this idea was his single greatest invention, and it is all the more remarkable for its having been conceived and promoted at a time when most English and European intellectuals were either reverencing the literary and philosophical achievements of the past or deploring the numerous signs of modern degradation and decline. Indeed, while Bacon was preaching progress and declaring a brave new dawn of scientific advance, many of his colleagues were persuaded that the world was at best creaking along towards a state of senile immobility and eventual darkness. “Our age is iron, and rusty too,” wrote John Donne, contemplating the signs of universal decay in a poem published six years after Bacon’s Advancement.

That history might in fact be progressive, i.e., an onward and upward ascent – and not, as Aristotle had taught, merely cyclical or, as cultural pessimists from Hesiod to Spengler have supposed, a descending or retrograde movement, became for Bacon an article of secular faith which he propounded with evangelical force and a sense of mission. In the Advancement, the idea is offered tentatively, as a kind of hopeful hypothesis. But in later works such as the New Organon, it becomes almost a promised destiny: Enlightenment and a better world, Bacon insists, lie within our power; they require only the cooperation of learned citizens and the active development of the arts and sciences.

h. The Reclassification of Knowledge

In Book II of De Dignitate (his expanded version of the Advancement) Bacon outlines his scheme for a new division of human knowledge into three primary categories: History, Poesy, and Philosophy (which he associates respectively with the three fundamental “faculties” of mind – memory, imagination, and reason). Although the exact motive behind this reclassification remains unclear, one of its main consequences seems unmistakable: it effectively promotes philosophy – and especially Baconian science – above the other two branches of knowledge, in essence defining history as the mere accumulation of brute facts, while reducing art and imaginative literature to the even more marginal status of “feigned history.”

Evidently Bacon believed that in order for a genuine advancement of learning to occur, the prestige of philosophy (and particularly natural philosophy) had to be elevated, while that of history and literature (in a word, humanism) needed to be reduced. Bacon’s scheme effectively accomplishes this by making history (the domain of fact, i.e., of everything that has happened) a virtual sub-species of philosophy (the domain of realistic possibility, i.e., of everything that can theoretically or actually occur). Meanwhile, poesy (the domain of everything that is imaginable or conceivable) is set off to the side as a mere illustrative vehicle. In essence, it becomes simply a means of recreating actual scenes or events from the past (as in history plays or heroic poetry) or of allegorizing or dramatizing new ideas or future possibilities (as in Bacon’s own interesting example of “parabolic poesy,” the New Atlantis.)

i. The New Organon

To the second part of his Great Instauration Bacon gave the title New Organon (or “True Directions concerning the Interpretation of Nature”). The Greek word organon means “instrument” or “tool,” and Bacon clearly felt he was supplying a new instrument for guiding and correcting the mind in its quest for a true understanding of nature. The title also glances at Aristotle’s Organon (a collection that includes his Categories and his Prior and Posterior Analytics) and thus suggests a “new instrument” destined to transcend or replace the older, no longer serviceable one. (This notion of surpassing ancient authority is aptly illustrated on the frontispiece of the 1620 volume containing the New Organon by a ship boldly sailing beyond the mythical pillars of Hercules, which supposedly marked the end of the known world.)

The New Organon is presented not in the form of a treatise or methodical demonstration but as a series of aphorisms, a technique that Bacon came to favor as less legislative and dogmatic and more in the true spirit of scientific experiment and critical inquiry. Combined with his gift for illustrative metaphor and symbol, the aphoristic style makes the New Organon in many places the most readable and literary of all Bacon’s scientific and philosophical works.

j. The Idols

In Book I of the New Organon (Aphorisms 39-68), Bacon introduces his famous doctrine of the “idols.” These are characteristic errors, natural tendencies, or defects that beset the mind and prevent it from achieving a full and accurate understanding of nature. Bacon points out that recognizing and counteracting the idols is as important to the study of nature as the recognition and refutation of bad arguments is to logic. Incidentally, he uses the word “idol” – from the Greek eidolon (“image” or “phantom”) – not in the sense of a false god or heathen deity but rather in the sense employed in Epicurean physics. Thus a Baconian idol is a potential deception or source of misunderstanding, especially one that clouds or confuses our knowledge of external reality.

Bacon identifies four different classes of idol. Each arises from a different source, and each presents its own special hazards and difficulties.

1. The Idols of the Tribe.

These are the natural weaknesses and tendencies common to human nature. Because they are innate, they cannot be completely eliminated, but only recognized and compensated for. Some of Bacon’s examples are:

  • Our senses – which are inherently dull and easily deceivable. (Which is why Bacon prescribes instruments and strict investigative methods to correct them.)
  • Our tendency to discern (or even impose) more order in phenomena than is actually there. As Bacon points out, we are apt to find similitude where there is actually singularity, regularity where there is actually randomness, etc.
  • Our tendency towards “wishful thinking.” According to Bacon, we have a natural inclination to accept, believe, and even prove what we would prefer to be true.
  • Our tendency to rush to conclusions and make premature judgments (instead of gradually and painstakingly accumulating evidence).

2. The Idols of the Cave.

Unlike the idols of the tribe, which are common to all human beings, those of the cave vary from individual to individual. They arise, that is to say, not from nature but from culture and thus reflect the peculiar distortions, prejudices, and beliefs that we are all subject to owing to our different family backgrounds, childhood experiences, education, training, gender, religion, social class, etc. Examples include:

  • Special allegiance to a particular discipline or theory.
  • High esteem for a few select authorities.
  • A “cookie-cutter” mentality – that is, a tendency to reduce or confine phenomena within the terms of our own narrow training or discipline.

3. The Idols of the Market Place.

These are hindrances to clear thinking that arise, Bacon says, from the “intercourse and association of men with each other.” The main culprit here is language, though not just common speech, but also (and perhaps particularly) the special discourses, vocabularies, and jargons of various academic communities and disciplines. He points out that “the idols imposed by words on the understanding are of two kinds”: “they are either names of things that do not exist” (e.g., the crystalline spheres of Aristotelian cosmology) or faulty, vague, or misleading names for things that do exist (according to Bacon, abstract qualities and value terms – e.g., “moist,” “useful,” etc. – can be a particular source of confusion).

4. The Idols of the Theatre.

Like the idols of the cave, those of the theatre are culturally acquired rather than innate. And although the metaphor of a theatre suggests an artificial imitation of truth, as in drama or fiction, Bacon makes it clear that these idols derive mainly from grand schemes or systems of philosophy – and especially from three particular types of philosophy:

  • Sophistical Philosophy – that is, philosophical systems based only on a few casually observed instances (or on no experimental evidence at all) and thus constructed mainly out of abstract argument and speculation. Bacon cites Scholasticism as a conspicuous example.
  • Empirical Philosophy – that is, a philosophical system ultimately based on a single key insight (or on a very narrow base of research), which is then erected into a model or paradigm to explain phenomena of all kinds. Bacon cites the example of William Gilbert, whose experiments with the lodestone persuaded him that magnetism operated as the hidden force behind virtually all earthly phenomena.
  • Superstitious Philosophy – this is Bacon’s phrase for any system of thought that mixes theology and philosophy. He cites Pythagoras and Plato as guilty of this practice, but also points his finger at pious contemporary efforts, similar to those of Creationists today, to found systems of natural philosophy on Genesis or the book of Job.

k. Induction

At the beginning of the Magna Instauratio and in Book II of the New Organon, Bacon introduces his system of “true and perfect Induction,” which he proposes as the essential foundation of scientific method and a necessary tool for the proper interpretation of nature. (This system was to have been more fully explained and demonstrated in Part IV of the Instauratio in a section titled “The Ladder of the Intellect,” but unfortunately the work never got beyond an introduction.)

According to Bacon, his system differs not only from the deductive logic and mania for syllogisms of the Schoolmen, but also from the classic induction of Aristotle and other logicians. As Bacon explains it, classic induction proceeds “at once from . . . sense and particulars up to the most general propositions” and then works backward (via deduction) to arrive at intermediate propositions. Thus, for example, from a few observations one might conclude (via induction) that “all new cars are shiny.” One would then be entitled to proceed backward from this general axiom to deduce such middle-level axioms as “all new Lexuses are shiny,” “all new Jeeps are shiny,” etc. – axioms that presumably would not need to be verified empirically since their truth would be logically guaranteed as long as the original generalization (“all new cars are shiny”) is true.

As Bacon rightly points out, one problem with this procedure is that if the general axioms prove false, all the intermediate axioms may be false as well. All it takes is one contradictory instance (in this case one new car with a dull finish) and “the whole edifice tumbles.” For this reason Bacon prescribes a different path. His method is to proceed “regularly and gradually from one axiom to another, so that the most general are not reached till the last.” In other words, each axiom – i.e., each step up “the ladder of intellect” – is thoroughly tested by observation and experimentation before the next step is taken. In effect, each confirmed axiom becomes a foothold to a higher truth, with the most general axioms representing the last stage of the process.

Thus, in the example described, the Baconian investigator would be obliged to examine a full inventory of new Chevrolets, Lexuses, Jeeps, etc., before reaching any conclusions about new cars in general. And while Bacon admits that such a method can be laborious, he argues that it eventually produces a stable edifice of knowledge instead of a rickety structure that collapses with the appearance of a single disconfirming instance. (Indeed, according to Bacon, when one follows his inductive procedure, a negative instance actually becomes something to be welcomed rather than feared. For instead of threatening an entire assembly, the discovery of a false generalization actually saves the investigator the trouble of having to proceed further in a particular direction or line of inquiry. Meanwhile the structure of truth that he has already built remains intact.)

Is Bacon’s system, then, a sound and reliable procedure, a strong ladder leading from carefully observed particulars to true and “inevitable” conclusions? Although he himself firmly believed in the utility and overall superiority of his method, many of his commentators and critics have had doubts. For one thing, it is not clear that the Baconian procedure, taken by itself, leads conclusively to any general propositions, much less to scientific principles or theoretical statements that we can accept as universally true. For at what point is the Baconian investigator willing to make the leap from observed particulars to abstract generalizations? After a dozen instances? A thousand? The fact is, Bacon’s method provides nothing to guide the investigator in this determination other than sheer instinct or professional judgment, and thus the tendency is for the investigation of particulars – the steady observation and collection of data – to go on continuously, and in effect endlessly.

One can thus easily imagine a scenario in which the piling up of instances becomes not just the initial stage in a process, but the very essence of the process itself; in effect, a zealous foraging after facts (in the New Organon Bacon famously compares the ideal Baconian researcher to a busy bee) becomes not only a means to knowledge, but an activity vigorously pursued for its own sake. Every scientist and academic person knows how tempting it is to put off the hard work of imaginative thinking in order to continue doing some form of rote research. Every investigator knows how easy it is to become wrapped up in data – with the unhappy result that one’s intended ascent up the Baconian ladder gets stuck in mundane matters of fact and never quite gets off the ground.

It was no doubt considerations like these that prompted the English physician (and neo-Aristotelian) William Harvey, of circulation-of-the-blood fame, to quip that Bacon wrote of natural philosophy “like a Lord Chancellor” – indeed like a politician or legislator rather than a practitioner. The assessment is just to the extent that Bacon in the New Organon does indeed prescribe a new and extremely rigid procedure for the investigation of nature rather than describe the more or less instinctive and improvisational – and by no means exclusively empirical – method that Kepler, Galileo, Harvey himself, and other working scientists were actually employing. In fact, other than Tycho Brahe, the Danish astronomer who, overseeing a team of assistants, faithfully observed and then painstakingly recorded entire volumes of astronomical data in tidy, systematically arranged tables, it is doubtful that there is another major figure in the history of science who can be legitimately termed an authentic, true-blooded Baconian. (Darwin, it is true, claimed that The Origin of Species was based on “Baconian principles.” However, it is one thing to collect instances in order to compare species and show a relationship among them; it is quite another to theorize a mechanism, namely evolution by mutation and natural selection, that elegantly and powerfully explains their entire history and variety.)

Science, that is to say, does not, and has probably never advanced according to the strict, gradual, ever-plodding method of Baconian observation and induction. It proceeds instead by unpredictable – and often intuitive and even (though Bacon would cringe at the word) imaginative – leaps and bounds. Kepler used Tycho’s scrupulously gathered data to support his own heart-felt and even occult belief that the movements of celestial bodies are regular and symmetrical, composing a true harmony of the spheres. Galileo tossed unequal weights from the Leaning Tower as a mere public demonstration of the fact (contrary to Aristotle) that they would fall at the same rate. He had long before satisfied himself that this would happen via the very un-Bacon-like method of mathematical reasoning and deductive thought-experiment. Harvey, by a similar process of quantitative analysis and deductive logic, knew that the blood must circulate, and it was only to provide proof of this fact that he set himself the secondary task of amassing empirical evidence and establishing the actual method by which it did so.

One could enumerate – in true Baconian fashion – a host of further instances. But the point is already made: advances in scientific knowledge have not been achieved for the most part via Baconian induction (which amounts to a kind of systematic and exhaustive survey of nature supposedly leading to ultimate insights) but rather by shrewd hints and guesses – in a word by hypotheses – that are then either corroborated or (in Karl Popper’s important term) falsified by subsequent research.

In summary, then, it can be said that Bacon underestimated the role of imagination and hypothesis (and overestimated the value of minute observation and bee-like data collection) in the production of new scientific knowledge. And in this respect it is true that he wrote of science like a Lord Chancellor, regally proclaiming the benefits of his own new and supposedly foolproof technique instead of recognizing and adapting procedures that had already been tested and approved. On the other hand, it must be added that Bacon did not present himself (or his method) as the final authority on the investigation of nature or, for that matter, on any other topic or issue relating to the advance of knowledge. By his own admission, he was but the Buccinator, or “trumpeter,” of such a revolutionary advance – not the founder or builder of a vast new system, but only the herald or announcing messenger of a new world to come.

3. Reputation and Cultural Legacy

If anyone deserves the title “universal genius” or “Renaissance man” (accolades traditionally reserved for those who make significant, original contributions to more than one professional discipline or area of learning), Bacon clearly merits the designation. Like Leonardo and Goethe, he produced important work in both the arts and sciences. Like Cicero, Marcus Aurelius, Benjamin Franklin, and Thomas Jefferson, he combined wide and ample intellectual and literary interests (from practical rhetoric and the study of nature to moral philosophy and educational reform) with a substantial political career. Like his near contemporary Machiavelli, he excelled in a variety of literary genres – from learned treatises to light entertainments – though, also like the great Florentine writer, he thought of himself mainly as a political statesman and practical visionary: a man whose primary goal was less to obtain literary laurels for himself than to mold the agendas and guide the policy decisions of powerful nobles and heads of state.

In our own era Bacon would be acclaimed as a “public intellectual,” though his personal record of service and authorship would certainly dwarf the achievements of most academic and political leaders today. Like nearly all public figures, he was controversial. His chaplain and first biographer William Rawley declared him “the glory of his age and nation” and portrayed him as an angel of enlightenment and social vision. His admirers in the Royal Society (an organization that traced its own inspiration and lineage to the Lord Chancellor’s writings) viewed him as nothing less than the daring originator of a new intellectual era. The poet Abraham Cowley called him a “Moses” and portrayed him as an exalted leader who virtually all by himself had set learning on a bold, firm, and entirely new path:

Bacon at last, a mighty Man, arose

Whom a wise King and Nature chose

Lord Chancellour of both their Lawes. . . .

The barren Wilderness he past,

Did on the very Border stand

Of the great promis’d Land,

And from the Mountains Top of his Exalted Wit,

Saw it himself and shew’d us it. . . .

Similarly adulatory if more prosaic assessments were offered by learned contemporaries or near contemporaries from Descartes and Gassendi to Robert Hooke and Robert Boyle. Leibniz was particularly generous and observed that, compared to Bacon’s philosophical range and lofty vision, even a great genius like Descartes “creeps on the ground.” On the other hand, Spinoza, another close contemporary, dismissed Bacon’s work (especially his inductive theories) completely and in effect denied that the supposedly grand philosophical revolution decreed by Bacon, and welcomed by his partisans, had ever occurred.

The response of the later Enlightenment was similarly divided, with a majority of thinkers lavishly praising Bacon while a dissenting minority castigated or even ridiculed him. The French encyclopedists Jean d’Alembert and Denis Diderot sounded the keynote of this 18th-century re-assessment, essentially hailing Bacon as a founding father of the modern era and emblazoning his name on the front page of the Encyclopedia. In a similar gesture, Kant dedicated his Critique of Pure Reason to Bacon and likewise saluted him as an early architect of modernity. Hegel, on the other hand, took a dimmer view. In his “Lectures on the History of Philosophy” he congratulated Bacon on his worldly sophistication and shrewdness of mind, but ultimately judged him to be a person of depraved character and a mere “coiner of mottoes.” In his view, the Lord Chancellor was a decidedly low-minded (read typically English and utilitarian) philosopher whose instruction was fit mainly for “civil servants and shopkeepers.”

Probably the fullest and most perceptive Enlightenment account of Bacon’s achievement and place in history was Voltaire’s laudatory essay in his Letters on the English. After referring to Bacon as the father of experimental philosophy, he went on to assess his literary merits, judging him to be an elegant, instructive, and witty writer, though too much given to “fustian.”

Bacon’s reputation and legacy remain controversial even today. While no historian of science or philosophy doubts his immense importance both as a proselytizer on behalf of the empirical method and as an advocate of sweeping intellectual reform, opinion varies widely as to the actual social value and moral significance of the ideas that he represented and effectively bequeathed to us. The issue basically comes down to one’s estimate of or sympathy for the entire Enlightenment/Utilitarian project. Those who for the most part share Bacon’s view that nature exists mainly for human use and benefit, and who furthermore endorse his opinion that scientific inquiry should aim first and foremost at the amelioration of the human condition and the “relief of man’s estate,” generally applaud him as a great social visionary. On the other hand, those who view nature as an entity in its own right, a higher-order estate of which the human community is only a part, tend to perceive him as a kind of arch-villain – the evil originator of the idea of science as the instrument of global imperialism and technological conquest.

On the one side, then, we have figures like the anthropologist and science writer Loren Eiseley, who portrays Bacon (whom he calls “the man who saw through time”) as a kind of Promethean culture hero. He praises Bacon as the great inventor of the idea of science as both a communal enterprise and a practical discipline in the service of humanity. On the other side, we have writers, from Theodor Adorno, Max Horkheimer, and Lewis Mumford to, more recently, Jeremy Rifkin and eco-feminist Carolyn Merchant, who have represented him as one of the main culprits behind what they perceive as western science’s continuing legacy of alienation, exploitation, and ecological oppression.

Clearly somewhere in between this ardent Baconolotry on the one hand and strident demonization of Bacon on the other lies the real Lord Chancellor: a Colossus with feet of clay. He was by no means a great system-builder (indeed his Magna Instauratio turned out to be less of a “grand edifice” than a magnificent heap) but rather, as he more modestly portrayed himself, a great spokesman for the reform of learning and a champion of modern science. In the end we can say that he was one of the giant figures of intellectual history – and as brilliant, and flawed, a philosopher as he was a statesman.

4. References and Further Reading

Note: The standard edition of Bacon’s Works and Letters and Life is still that of James Spedding, et. al., (14 volumes, London, 1857- 1874), also available in a facsimile reprint (Stuttgart, 1989).

  • Adorno, Theodor and Max Horkheimer. The Dialectic of Enlightenment. 1944.
  • Anderson, F. H. Francis Bacon: His Career and His Thought. Los Angeles: University of Southern California Press, 1962.
  • Bury, J.B. The Idea of Progress. London: MacMillan, 1920.
  • Eiseley, Loren. The Man Who Saw Through Time. New York: Scribners, 1973.
  • Fish, Stanley E. “The Experience of Bacon’s Essays.” In Self-Consuming Artifacts. Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1972.
  • Gaukroger, Stephen. Francis Bacon and the Transformation of Early-modern Philosophy. Cambridge, U.K. ; New York : Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Merchant, Carolyn. The Death of Nature: Women, Ecology, and the Scientific Revolution. San Francisco: Harper and Row, 1980.
  • Mumford, Lewis. Technics and Civilization. 1934.
  • Lampert, Laurence. Nietzsche and Modern Times : A Study of Bacon, Descartes, and Nietzsche. New Haven, Conn.: Yale University Press, 1993.
  • Rifkin, Jeremy. Biosphere Politics. New York: Crown, 1991.
  • Rossi, Paolo. Francis Bacon: from Magic to Science. Trans. Sacha Rabinovitch. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1968.
  • Vickers, Brian. Francis Bacon. Harlow, UK: Longman Group, 1978.
  • Vickers, Brian, Ed. Francis Bacon. New York : Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Whitney, Charles. Francis Bacon and Modernity. New Haven, CN: Yale University Press, 1986.

Author Information

David Simpson
DePaul University
U. S. A.

Martin Luther (1483—1546)

lutherGerman theologian, professor, pastor, and church reformer.  Luther began the Protestant Reformation with the publication of his Ninety-Five Theses on October 31, 1517.  In this publication, he attacked the Church’s sale of indulgences.  He advocated a theology that rested on God’s gracious activity in Jesus Christ, rather than in human works.  Nearly all Protestants trace their history back to Luther in one way or another.  Luther’s relationship to philosophy is complex and should not be judged only by his famous statement that “reason is the devil’s whore.”

Given Luther’s critique of philosophy and his famous phrase that philosophy is the “devil’s whore,” it would be easy to assume that Luther had only contempt for philosophy and reason. Nothing could be further from the truth. Luther believed, rather, that philosophy and reason had important roles to play in our lives and in the life of the community. However, he also felt that it was important to remember what those roles were and not to confuse the proper use of philosophy with an improper one.

Properly understood and used, philosophy and reason are a great aid to individuals and society. Improperly used, they become a great threat to both. Likewise, revelation and the gospel when used properly are an aid to society, but when misused also have sad and profound implications.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Theology
    1. Theological Background: William of Occam
    2. Theology of the Cross
    3. The Law and the Gospel
    4. Deus Absconditus – The Hidden God
  3. Relationship to Philosophy
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Biography

Martin Luther was born to peasant stock on November 10, 1483 in Eisleben in the Holy Roman Empire – in what is today eastern Germany.  Soon after Luther’s birth, his family moved from Eisleben to Mansfeld. His father was a relatively successful miner and smelter and Mansfeld was a larger mining town. Martin was the second son born to Hans and Magarete (Lindemann) Luther. Two of his brothers died during outbreaks of the plague.  One other brother, James, lived to adulthood.

Luther’s father knew that mining was a cyclical occupation, and he wanted more security for his promising young son.  Hans Luther decided that he would do whatever was necessary to see that Martin could become a lawyer. Hans saw to it that Martin started school in Mansfeld probably around seven. The school stressed Latin and a bit of logic and rhetoric.  When Martin was 14 he was sent to Magdeburg to continue his studies. He stayed only one year in Magdeburg and then enrolled in Latin school in Eisenach until 1501. In 1501 he enrolled in the University of Erfurt where he studied the basic course for a Master of Arts (grammar, logic, rhetoric, metaphysics, etc.). Significant to his spiritual and theological development was the principal role of William of Occam’s theology and metaphysics in Erfurt’s curriculum. In 1505, it seemed that Han’s Luther’s plans were about to finally be realized.  His son was on the verge of becoming a lawyer.  Han’s Luther’s plans were interrupted by a thunderstorm and vow.

In July of 1505, Martin was caught in a horrific thunderstorm.  Afraid that he was going to die, he screamed out a vow, “Save me, St. Anna, and I shall become a monk.” St. Anna was the mother of the Virgin Mary and the patron saint of miners. Most argue that this commitment to become a monk could not have come out of thin air and instead represents an intensification experience in which an already formulated thought is expanded and deepened. On July 17th Luther entered the Augustinian Monastery at Erfurt.

The decision to enter the monastery was a difficult one. Martin knew that he would greatly disappoint his parents (which he did), but he also knew that one must keep a promise made to God. Beyond that, however, he also had strong internal reasons to join the monastery. Luther was haunted by insecurity about his salvation (he describes these insecurities in striking tones and calls them Anfectungen or Afflictions.) A monastery was the perfect place to find assurance.

Assurance evaded him however. He threw himself into the life of a monk with verve. It did not seem to help. Finally, his mentor told him to focus on Christ and him alone in his quest for assurance. Though his anxieties would plague him for still years to come, the seeds for his later assurance were laid in that conversation.

In 1510, Luther traveled as part of delegation from his monastery to Rome (he was not very impressed with what he saw.) In 1511, he transferred from the monastery in Erfurt to one in Wittenberg where, after receiving his doctor of theology degree, he became a professor of biblical theology at the newly founded University of Wittenberg.

In 1513, he began his first lectures on the Psalms.  In these lectures, Luther’s critique of the theological world around him begins to take shape. Later, in lectures on Paul’s Epistle to the Romans (in 1515/16) this critique becomes more noticeable. It was during these lectures that Luther finally found the assurance that had evaded him for years. The discovery that changed Luther’s life ultimately changed the course of church history and the history of Europe.  In Romans, Paul writes of the “righteousness of God.” Luther had always understood that term to mean that God was a righteous judge that demanded human righteousness. Now, Luther understood righteousness as a gift of God’s grace. He had discovered (or recovered) the doctrine of justification by grace alone. This discovery set him afire.

In 1517, he posted a sheet of theses for discussion on the University’s chapel door. These Ninety-Five Theses set out a devastating critique of the church’s sale of indulgences and explained the fundamentals of justification by grace alone. Luther also sent a copy of the theses to Archbishop Albrecht of Mainz calling on him to end the sale of indulgences. Albrecht was not amused. In Rome, cardinals saw Luther’s theses as an attack on papal authority. In 1518 at a meeting of the Augustinian Order in Heidelberg, Luther set out his positions with even more precision. In the Heidelberg Disputation, we see the signs of a maturing in Luther’s thought and new clarity surrounding his theological perspective – the Theology of the Cross.

After the Heidelberg meeting in October 1518, Luther was told to recant his positions by the Papal Legate, Thomas Cardinal Cajetan. Luther stated that he could not recant unless his mistakes were pointed out to him by appeals to “scripture and right reason” he would not, in fact, could not recant. Luther’s refusal to recant set in motion his ultimate excommunication.

Throughout 1519, Luther continued to lecture and write in Wittenberg. In June and July of that year, he participated in another debate on Indulgences and the papacy in Leipzig. Finally, in 1520, the pope had had enough. On June 15th the pope issued a bull (Exsurge Domini – Arise O’Lord) threatening Luther with excommunication. Luther received the bull on October 10th. He publicly burned it on December 10th.

In January 1521, the pope excommunicated Luther.  In March, he was summonsed by Emperor Charles V to Worms to defend himself. During the Diet of Worms, Luther refused to recant his position. Whether he actually said, “Here I stand, I can do no other” is uncertain. What is known is that he did refuse to recant and on May 8th was placed under Imperial Ban.

This placed Luther and his duke in a difficult position. Luther was now a condemned and wanted man. Luther hid out at the Wartburg Castle until May of 1522 when he returned to Wittenberg. He continued teaching. In 1524, Luther left the monastery. In 1525, he married Katharina von Bora.

From 1533 to his death in 1546 he served as the Dean of the theology faculty at Wittenberg. He died in Eisleben on 18 February 1546.

2. Theology

a. Theological Background: William of Occam

The medieval worldview was rational, ordered, and synthetic. Thomas Aquinas embodied it. It survived until the acids of war, plague, poverty, and social discord began to eat away its underlying presupposition – that the world rested on the being of God.

All of life was grounded in the mind of God. In the hierarchy of Being that establishes justice, the church was understood as the connection between the secular and divine. However, as the crises of the late middle ages increased, this reassurance no longer assuaged.

William of Occam recognized the shortcomings of Thomas’s system and cut away most of the ontological grounding of existence. In its place, Occam posited revelation and covenant. The world does not need to be grounded in some artificial, unknowable, ladder of Being.  Instead, one must rely on God’s faithfulness. We are contingent upon God alone.

This contingency would be terrible and unbearable without the assurance of God’s covenant. In terms of God’s absolute power (potentia absoluta), God can do anything.  He can make a lie the truth, he can make adultery a virtue and monogamy a vice. The only limit to this power is consistency—God cannot contradict his own essence. To live in a world ordered by whim would be terrible; one would never know if one was acting justly or unjustly. However, God has decided on a particular way of acting (potentia ordinata). God has covenanted with creation, and committed himself to a particular way of acting.

While rejecting some of Thomas, Occam did not reject the entire scholastic project.  He, too, synthesized and depended heavily upon Aristotle. This dependence becomes significant in the covenantal piety of justification. The fundamental question of justification is where does one find fellowship with God, i.e., how does one know one is accepted by God?  The logic of Aristotle taught Thomas and Occam that “like is known by like.”  Thus, union or fellowship with God must take place on God’s level. How does this happen? Practice.

All people are born, it was argued, with potential. Even though all creation suffers under the condemnation of the Fall of Adam and Eve, there remains a divine spark of potentiality, a syntersis. This potential must be actualized. It must be habituated. Habituation was important for both Thomas and Occam; however, Occam slightly modifies Thomas and that modification has important implications in Luther’s search for a gracious God.

From Thomas’s perspective the divine spark is infused with God’s grace, giving one the power to be contrite (contritio) and co-operate with God. This co-operation with God’s grace merits God’s reward (meritum de condign).  However, Occam asked an important question: if the process begins with God’s infusion of grace, can it truly merit anything? He answered, no! Therefore you should do the best you can. By doing your best, even as minimal as it is, this will merit (meritum de congruo) an infusion of grace: facienti quod in se est Deus non denegat gratiam (God will not deny his grace to anyone who does what lies within him.) Doing one’s best meant rejecting evil and doing good.

Within this context of covenant Luther struggled to prove that he was good enough to merit God’s grace. However, he failed to convince himself. He might have been contrite, but was he contrite enough?  This uncertainty afflicted (Anfectungen) him for years.

b. Theology of the Cross

Luther’s attempts to prove his worthiness failed.  He continued to be plagued by uncertainty and doubt concerning his salvation. Finally, during his Lectures on Paul’s Epistle to the Romans he found solace.  Instead of storehouses of merit, indulgences, habituation, and "doing what is within one," God accepts the sinner in spite of the sin. Acceptance is based on who one is rather than what one does. Justification is bestowed rather than achieved. Justification is not based on human righteousness, but on God’s righteousness—revealed and confirmed in Christ.

In St. Paul, Luther finally found a word of hope. He finally found a word of assurance and discovered the graciousness of God. The discovery of God’s graciousness pro me (for me) revolutionizes all aspects of Luther’s life and thought. From now on, Luther’s response to the trials of his life and the crises of the late medieval period was to be certain of God, but never to be secure in human society.

A tautology of Luther’s theology becomes: one must always “Let God be God.”  This frees human beings to be human.  We do not have to achieve salvation; rather, it is a gift to be received.  Salvation thus is the presupposition of the life of the Christian and not its goal.  This belief engendered his rejection of indulgences and his movement to a theologia crucis (Theology of the Cross).

Why were indulgences rejected? Simply put, they epitomize everything that from Luther’s perspective was wrong with the church. Instead of dependence upon God, they placed salvation in the hands of traveling salesmen hocking indulgences. They embody his rejection of all types of theology that are based in models of covenant.

The import of the Theology of the Cross was the discovery of God’s passive righteousness and theological models based in Testament.  From the author of Hebrews, Luther takes an understanding of Jesus Christ as the last will and testament of God. God has written humanity in the will as heirs of God and co-heirs with Christ (See Romans 8).

The rejection of covenant model theologies and the movement to testament is a fundamental aspect of Luther’s theologia crucis. It is a rejection of any type of a theology of glory (theologia gloriae). The rejection of the theology of glory has a profound impact on Luther’s anthropology of a Christian.

This rejection is illustrated by Luther’s small but significant alteration of Augustinian anthropology. In that system, human beings are partim bonnum, partim malum or partim iustus, partim peccare (partly good/just, partly bad/sinner). The goal of a Christian’s life is to grow in righteousness. In other words, one must work to decrease the side of the equation that is bad and sinful. As one decreases the sin in oneself, the good and just aspects of one’s being increase.

Luther’s anthropology, however, is an outright and total rejection of progress; because no matter how one understands it, it is a work and thus must be rejected. Luther’s alternative characterization of Christian anthropology was simul iustus et peccator (at once righteous and sinful.) Now, he begins to speak of righteousness in two ways: coram deo (righteousness before God) and coram hominibus (before man). Instead of a development in righteousness based in the person, or an infusion of merit from the saints, a person is judged righteous before God because of the works of Christ. But, absent the perspective of God and the righteousness of Christ, based on one’s own merit—a Christian still looks like a sinner.

c. The Law and the Gospel

The distinction between the Law and the Gospel is a fundamental dialectic in Luther’s thought. He argues that God interacts with humanity in two fundamental ways – the law and the gospel. The law comes to humanity as the commands of God – such as the Ten Commandments. The law allows the human community to exist and survive because it limits chaos and evil and convicts us of our sinfulness. All humanity has some grasp of the law through the conscience. The law convicts us our sin and drives us to the gospel, but it is not God’s avenue for salvation.

Salvation comes to humanity through the Good News (Gospel) of Jesus Christ. The Good News is that righteousness is not a demand upon the sinner but a gift to the sinner. The sinner simply accepts the gift through faith. For Luther the folly of indulgences was that they confused the law with the gospel. By stating that humanity must do something to merit forgiveness they promulgated the notion that salvation is achieved rather than received. Much of Luther’s career focused on deconstructing the idea of the law as an avenue for salvation.

d. Deus Absconditus – The Hidden God

Another fundamental aspect of Luther’s theology is his understanding of God. In rejecting much of scholastic thought Luther rejected the scholastic belief in continuity between revelation and perception. Luther notes that revelation must be indirect and concealed. Luther’s theology is based in the Word of God (thus his phrase sola scriptura – scripture alone). It is based not in speculation or philosophical principles, but in revelation.

Because of humanity’s fallen condition, one can neither understand the redemptive word nor can one see God face to face. Here Luther’s exposition on number twenty of his Heidelberg Disputation is important. It is an allusion to Exodus 33, where Moses seeks to see the Glory of the Lord but instead sees only the backside. No one can see God face to face and live, so God reveals himself on the backside, that is to say, where it seems he should not be. For Luther this meant in the human nature of Christ, in his weakness, his suffering, and his foolishness.

Thus revelation is seen in the suffering of Christ rather than in moral activity or created order and is addressed to faith. The Deus Absconditus is actually quite simple. It is a rejection of philosophy as the starting point for theology. Why? Because if one begins with philosophical categories for God one begins with the attributes of God: i.e., omniscient, omnipresent, omnipotent, impassible, etc. For Luther, it was impossible to begin there and by using syllogisms or other logical means to end up with a God who suffers on the cross on behalf of humanity. It simply does not work. The God revealed in and through the cross is not the God of philosophy but the God of revelation. Only faith can understand and appreciate this, logic and reason – to quote St. Paul become a stumbling block to belief instead of a helpmate.

3. Relationship to Philosophy

Given Luther’s critique of philosophy and his famous phrase that philosophy is the “devil’s whore,” it would be easy to assume that Luther had only contempt for philosophy and reason. Nothing could be further from the truth. Luther believed, rather, that philosophy and reason had important roles to play in our lives and in the life of the community. However, he also felt that it was important to remember what those roles were and not to confuse the proper use of philosophy with an improper one.

Properly understood and used, philosophy and reason are a great aid to individuals and society. Improperly used, they become a great threat to both. Likewise, revelation and the gospel when used properly are an aid to society, but when misused also have sad and profound implications.

The proper role of philosophy is organizational and as an aid in governance. When Cardinal Cajetan first demanded Luther’s recantation of the Ninety-Five Theses, Luther appealed to scripture and right reason. Reason can be an aid to faith in that it helps to clarify and organize, but it is always second-order discourse. It is, following St. Anselm, fides quarenes intellectum (faith seeking understanding) and never the reverse. Philosophy tells us that God is omnipotent and impassible; revelation tells us that Jesus Christ died for humanity’s sin. The two cannot be reconciled. Reason is the devil’s whore precisely because asks the wrong questions and looks in the wrong direction for answers. Revelation is the only proper place for theology to begin. Reason must always take a back-seat.

Reason does play a primary role in governance and in most human interaction. Reason, Luther argued, is necessary for a good and just society. In fact, unlike most of his contemporaries, Luther did not believe that a ruler had to be Christian, only reasonable. Here, opposite to his discussion of theology, it is revelation that is improper. Trying to govern using the gospel as one’s model would either corrupt the government or corrupt the gospel. The gospel’s fundamental message is forgiveness, government must maintain justice. To confuse the two here is just as troubling as confusing them when discussing theology. If forgiveness becomes the dominant model in government, people being sinful, chaos will increase. If however, the government claims the gospel but acts on the basis of justice, then people will be misled as to the proper nature of the gospel.

Luther was self-consciously trying to carve out proper realms for revelation and philosophy or reason. Each had a proper role that enables humanity to thrive. Chaos only became a problem when the two got confused.One cannot understand Luther’s relationship to philosophy and his discussions of philosophy without understanding that key concept.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

Key Primary Sources in English:

  • Luther's Works (LW), ed. J. Pelikan and H.T. Lehmann. St. Louis, MO: Concordia, and Philadelphia, PA: Fortress Press, 1955 -1986. 55 vols.
    • Of all the major works of Luther, this is the best edition in English. It will soon be out on CD-Rom.
  • 1513-1515, Lectures on the Psalms (LW: 10 -11).
    • Luther’s earliest lectures. These are important because we begin to see themes that will eventually become the Theology of the Cross.
  • 1515-1516, Lectures on Romans (LW: 25).
    • The patterns of the Theology of the Cross become a bit more evident. Many scholars believe that Luther made his final discovery of the doctrine of Justification by Faith while giving these lectures.
  • 1517, Ninety Five Theses (LW: 31).
    • The seminal document of the Reformation in Germany. These theses led to the eventual break with Rome over indulgences and grace.
  • 1518, Heidelberg Disputation (LW: 31)
    • The best example of Luther’s emerging Theology of the Cross.He contrasts human works to God’s works in and through the Cross and shows the emptiness of human achievement and the importance of grace.
  • 1519, Two Kinds of Righteousness (LW:31).
    • Summary of his position that righteousness is received rather than achieved.
  • 1520, Freedom of a Christian (LW: 31).
    • Luther’s ethics, in which he explains that “A Christian is a perfectly free lord of all, subject to none. A Christian is perfectly dutiful servant of all, subject to all.”
  • 1520, To the German Nobility (LW: 44).
    • A call for reform in Germany, it highlights some of the complexity of Luther’s thought on church and state relations.
  • 1521, Concerning the Letter and the Spirit (LW:39).
    • A summary of the Law and Gospel.
  • 1522, Preface to Romans (LW: 35).
    • A summary of Luther’s understanding of Justification by Faith.
  • 1523, On Temporal Authority (LW 45).
    • Sets out Luther’s doctrine of the Two Kingdom’s most clearly.
  • 1525, The Bondage of the Will (LW: 33).
    • In a debate with Erasmus about human freedom and bondage to sin. Luther argues that humanity is bound to sin completely and only freed from that bondage by God’s Grace.
  • 1525, Against the Robbing and Murdering Hordes of Peasants (LW:45).
    • Written before the Peasant’s War, it was published afterward.
  • 1530, Larger Catechism (LW:34).
    • A summary of Christian doctrine, to be used in instruction.
  • 1531, Dr. Martin Luther's Warning to His Dear German People (LW:45).
    • Luther’s first expression of a right to resist tyranny.
  • 1536, Disputation Concerning Justification (LW: 34).
    • A mature presentation of Luther’s doctrine on Justification.
  • 1536, Disputation Concerning Man (LW: 34).
    • His anthropology, but also gives a glimpse of his understanding of the proper role of philosophy and reason.

b. Secondary Sources

Key Secondary Sources in English on the Life and Thought of Luther:

  • Bainton,Roland H.Here I Stand: A Life of Martin Luther.  New York: Abingdon-Cokesbury Press, 1950.
    • The most popular biography of Luther, it is readeable and very thorough.
  • Brecht, Martin. Martin Luther. Three Volumes. Translated by James L. Schaaf. Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1985-1993.
    • The authoritative biography of Luther.
  • Cameron, Euan. The European Reformation.Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1991.
    • An excellent introduction to the Reformation era.
  • Cargill Thompson,W.D.J. The Political Thought of Martin Luther.  Edited by Philip Broadhead. Totowa, NJ: Barnes & Noble Books, 1984.
    • The best work on Luther's political theology.
  • Edwards, Mark U., Jr. Luther’s Last Battles: Politics and Polemics, 1531-1546.Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1983.
    • One of the few books to focus on the older Luther. It is an excellent study in Luther after the Diet of Augsburg.
  • Forde, Gerhard, O.On Being a Theologian of the Cross: Reflections on Luther’s Heidelberg Disputation, 1518. Grand Rapids, MI: Eerdmans, 1997.
    • The Theology of the Cross is a fundamental doctrine in Luther. Forde takes an new look at the doctrine in light of Luther's role as pastor.
  • George, Timothy. Theology of the Reformers.  Nashville: Broadman Press, 1988.
    • This is an excellent introduction to Luther and puts his thought in dialogue with other major reformers, i.e., Zwingli and Calvin.
  • Lindberg, Carter. The European Reformations Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, Ltd., 1996.
    • The best introduction to the Reformation era, it covers not only the reformers but the context and culture of the era as well.
  • Loewenich, Walter von. Luther’s Theology of the Cross, trans. Herber J.A. Bouman. Minneapolis: Augsburg Publishing House, 1976.
    • The classic work on the Theology of the Cross.
  • Lohse, Bernhard. Martin Luther:An Introduction to his Life and Work.  Translated by Robert C. Schultz.Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1986.
    • In a handbook format, this is an essential ready-reference to Luther and his works.
  • McGrath, Alister E. The Intellectual Origins of the European Reformation. Oxford: Blackwell Press, 1987.
    • This book covers the scholastic and nominalist background of the reformation.
  • Oberman,Heiko. The Dawn of the Reformation: Essays in Late Medieval and Early Reformation Thought. Edinburgh: T & T Clark, 1986.
    • A classic that places the reformation era within the wider context of the late medieval era and the early modern era.
  • Luther: Man between God and the Devil.  Translated by Eileen Walliser-Schwarzbart. New York: Image Books, Doubleday:1982.
    • An excellent biography of Luther that examines Luther in light of his quest for a gracious God and his fight against the Devil.
  • Ozment, Steven. The Age of Reform:1250-1550:An Intellectual and Religious History of Late Medieval and Reformation Europe.  New Haven:Yale University Press, 1980.
    • Ozment places the reformation in a wider context and sees the impetus for reform stretching back into what is normally considered the High Medieval Era.
  • Pelikan, Jaroslav. The Christian Tradition: A History of the Development of Doctrine. Volume 4: Reformation of Church and Dogma (1300-1700). Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984.
    • Part of a five volume history of doctrine, Pelikan looks at the doctrinal issues at work in the reformation. He is not as concerned with history as he is with theological development.
  • Rupp,Gordon. Patterns of Reformation.  Philadelphia: Fortress Press,1969.
    • A thorough study of the wider issues raised by the reformation.
  • Watson,Philip S. Let God be God!: An Interpretation of the Theology of Martin Luther. London: Epworth Press, 1947.
    • A classic study stressing the theocentric nature of Luther's thought.

Author Information

David M. Whitford
Claflin University
U. S. A.

Justus Lipsius (1547—1606)

LipsiusJustus Lipsius, a Belgian classical philologist and Humanist, wrote a series of works designed to revive ancient Stoicism in a form that would be compatible with Christianity. The most famous of these is De Constantia (‘On Constancy’) in which he advocated a Stoic-inspired ideal of constancy in the face of unpleasant external events, but also carefully distinguished those parts of Stoic philosophy that the orthodox Christian should reject or modify. This modified form of Stoicism influenced a number of contemporary thinkers, creating an intellectual movement that has come to be known as Neostoicism.

Lipsius has been described as the greatest Renaissance scholar of the Low Countries after Erasmus. The role that he played in the revival of interest in Stoicism during the late Renaissance was similar to that performed by Marsilio Ficino with regard to Platonism and Pierre Gassendi with regard to Epicureanism. As such, he stands as a key figure in the history of Renaissance philosophy and the Renaissance revival of ancient thought.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
  2. Life
  3. Works
    1. Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex
    2. De Constantia Libri Duo
      1. Form
      2. Analysis of Contents
      3. Definition of constantia
      4. Four Arguments Concerning Public Evils
      5. Four Modifications of Ancient Stoicism
      6. Summary
    3. Later Stoic Works
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Background

Justus Lipsius's philosophical reputation rests upon his status as the principal figure in the Renaissance revival of Stoicism. Stoicism was one of the great Hellenistic schools of philosophy and dominated ancient intellectual life for at least 400 years. Founded by Zeno of Citium around 300 B.C.C., the school developed under Cleanthes, Chrysippus, Panaetius, and Posidonius. In the first century B.C. it appealed to high-ranking Romans including Cicero and Cato. In the first two centuries C.E. it reached its height of popularity under the influence of Musonius Rufus and Epictetus. In the second century C.E. it found its most famous exponent in the form of the Roman Emperor Marcus Aurelius. However, after the second century Stoicism was soon eclipsed in popularity by Neoplatonism.

Despite this decline in late antiquity, Stoicism continued to exert an influence. Its ideas were discussed by Church Fathers such as St. Augustine, Lactantius, and Tertullian. In the Middle Ages its impact can be seen in the ethical works of Peter Abelard and his pupil John of Salisbury, transmitted via the readily available Latin works of Seneca and Cicero. In the fourteenth century Stoicism attracted the attention of Petrarch who produced a substantial ethical work entitled De Remediis Utriusque Fortunae ('On the Remedies of Both Kinds of Fortune') inspired by Seneca and drawing upon an account of the Stoic theory of the passions made by Cicero. With the rediscovery of the works of the Stoic philosopher Epictetus by famous Humanists such as Perotti and Politian in the fifteenth century, interest in Stoicism continued to develop. However, the Renaissance revival of Stoicism remained somewhat limited until Justus Lipsius.


Justus Lipsius (the Latinized version of Joest Lips) was born in Overyssche, a village near Brussels and Louvain, in 1547. He studied first with the Jesuits in Cologne and later at the Catholic University of Louvain. After completing his education he visited Rome, in his new position as secretary to Cardinal Granvelle, staying for two years in order to study the ancient monuments and explore the unsurpassed libraries of classical literature. In 1572 Lipsius's property in Belgium was taken by Spanish troops during the civil war while he was away on a trip to Vienna (a trip that would later be used as the backdrop for the dialogue in De Constantia over a decade later). Without property, Lipsius applied for a position at the Lutheran University of Jena. This was the first of a number of institutional moves that required Lipsius to change his publicly professed faith. His new colleagues at Jena remained sceptical of this radical transformation and Lipsius was eventually forced to leave Jena after only two years in favour of Cologne. While at Cologne he prepared notes on Tacitus that he used in his critical edition of 1574.

In 1576 Lispius returned to Catholic Louvain. However after his property was looted by soldiers a second time he fled again in 1579, this time to the Calvinist University of Leiden. He remained at Leiden for thirteen years and it is to this period that his two most famous books - De Constantia Libri Duo (1584) and Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex (1589) – belong. However, Lipsius was by upbringing a Catholic and eventually he sought to return to Louvain, via a brief period in Liège. In 1592 Lipsius accepted the Chair of Latin History and Literature at Louvain. To this final period belong his editorial work on Seneca and his two detailed studies of Stoicism, the Manuductio ad Stoicam Philosophiam and Physiologia Stoicorum. The two studies were published first in 1604 and the edition of Seneca in 1605. Lipsius died in Louvain in 1606.

Among Lipsius's friends was his publisher, the famous printer Christopher Plantin, with whom he often stayed in Antwerp. Among his pupils was Philip Rubens, brother of the painter Peter Paul Rubens who portrayed Lipsius after his death in 'The Four Philosophers’ (c. 1611, now in the Pitti Palace, Florence). Among his admirers was Michel de Montaigne who described him as one of the most learned men then alive (Essais 2.12).

3. Works

Lipsius was a prolific author, publishing his first work Variarum Lectionum Libri IV ('Four Books of Various Readings') - a collection of philological comments and conjectures – in 1569, while still in his twenties. His reputation today is primarily as a Latin philologist and stands upon his critical editions of Tacitus and Seneca. He also produced a number of philological studies and a large correspondence, some of which he published. His principal philosophical works are De Constantia Libri Duo and Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex, complementing his editions of Seneca and Tacitus respectively.

a. Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex

In his Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex ('Six Books on Politics or Civil Doctrine') Lipsius drew upon a wide range of classical sources, with a particular emphasis upon Tacitus, and the work has been characterized, not unfairly, as not much more than a compendium of quotations. In it he argued that no State should permit more than one religion within its borders and that all dissent should be punished without mercy. Experience had taught him that civil conflict enflamed by religious intolerance was far more dangerous and destructive than despotism.

The treatise is concerned with the creation of civil life, defined as 'that which we lead in the society of men, one with another, to mutual commodity and profit, and common use of all' (Pol. 1.1). Such a life has two necessary conditions, virtue (virtute) and prudence (prudentia). Book One is devoted to an analysis of these two conditions: virtue requires piety and goodness; prudence is dependent upon use and memory. Book Two opens by arguing that government is necessary for civil life and that the best form of government is a principality. Civil concord requires all to submit to the will of one. ‘Principality’ (principatus) is defined as ‘rule by one for the good of all’ (Pol. 2.3). For the Prince to achieve this he himself must have both virtue and prudence. The remainder of Book Two is devoted to princely virtues, the most important being justice and clemency. Book Three moves on to consider princely prudence, and this remains the theme for the rest of the work. There are two types of prudence, one’s own and the advice of others. Book Three focuses upon prudent advisors in the form of counsellors and ministers. Book Four is concerned with a Prince’s own prudence, which must be carefully developed in the light of experience. This itself may be divided into civil and military prudence. The rest of Book Four outlines two types of civil prudence, that concerned with matters divine and that concerned with matters human. Military Prudence is the subject of Books Five and Six. Book Five deals with external military prudence (war with foreign powers), while Book Six deals with internal military prudence (civil war).

The central theme of the work is clear from the outset. Lipsius - pre-empting Hobbes – places order and peace far above civil liberties and personal freedom. Individual political rights are little consolation when surrounded by violent anarchy. The first task for politics is to secure peace for all and this can only be done if power is concentrated in one individual. It can also only be achieved if only one religion is allowed in any particular State. If one has concerns about such a concentration of power, the proper way to reduce them is to educate the holder of power, to develop his virtue and prudence, and to remind him that he holds power in order to secure peace, not to create terror. If a Prince forgets this last point and turns into a tyrant, there may be grounds to challenge his position. However Lipsius emphasizes that there is nothing more miserable than civil war which should be avoided at all costs.

b. De Constantia Libri Duo

Lipsius's principal philosophical work is De Constantia Libri Duo ('Two Books on Constancy’), published in 1584. The title is borrowed from Seneca’s dialogue De Constantia Sapientis. This work was immensely popular and went through numerous editions. It was translated into English four times between 1594 and 1670. It for this work that Lipsius became famous in the succeeding centuries, inspiring the intellectual movement that has come to be known as Neostoicism. This work was conceived as an attempt to revive Stoic philosophy as a living movement as it had been in antiquity and, in particular, as a practical antidote to public evils.

i. Form

The work takes the form of a dialogue between Lipsius and his friend Langius (Charles de Langhe, Canon of Liège). This no doubt fictional conversation is set within the context of a visit to Langius by Lipsius during the course of a trip to Vienna that Lipsius had actually undertaken in 1572. While some distance from his troubled homeland, the dialogue's character Lipsius reflects upon the nature of public evils (mala publica) and is guided by the older and wiser Langius into whose mouth the positive content of the dialogue is placed.

ii. Analysis of Contents

The dialogue is divided into two books. However a single structure operates throughout the entire work. The opening chapters of Book One introduce the idea that in order to escape public evils one must change one's mind, not one’s location (Const. 1.1-3). The concept of constancy is introduced as that which must be cultivated in the mind in order to achieve such a change (Const. 1.4-7). After a brief survey of the enemies of constancy (Const. 1.8-12), the four central arguments of the work, concerning the nature of public evil, are introduced (Const. 1.13). The first two of these arguments occupy the remainder of Book One (Const. 1.14 and 15-22). After a brief interlude at the beginning of Book Two on the nature of the philosophical project at hand (Const. 2.1-5), the remaining two arguments follow (Const. 2.6-17 and 18-26). The final chapter functions as a summary (Const. 2.27).

iii. Definition of constantia

The central concept in this work is, not surprisingly, constancy (constantia). It is introduced in Const. 1.4 and defined as a right and immovable strength of mind, neither elated nor depressed by external or chance events. The mother of constancy is patience (patientia), defined as a voluntary endurance without complaint of all things that can happen to or in a man.

However key to both of these concepts is the distinction between reason (ratio) and opinion (opinio). While opinion leads to inconstancy, it is reason that is able to form the foundation for constancy. Cultivating reason is thus the way in which one can reach the goal of constancy. Here Lipsius draws upon relatively common Stoic ideas concerning the passions or emotions (affectus; in Greek, pathê). Emotions are the product of mere opinions and lead to distress and imbalance. Analysing and rejecting those opinions in favour of rational understanding will free one from emotions and thus the inconstancy that they create. The wise man who enjoys constancy will be free from emotions such as desire (cupiditas), joy (gaudium), fear (metus), and sorrow (dolor).

iv. Four Arguments Concerning Public Evils

The core of De Constantia is the series of four arguments concerning the nature of public evils. These are outlined in Const. 1.13 and then developed, in turn, in Const. 1.14, 1.15-22, 2.6-17, and 2.18-26. It is argued that public evils are (a) imposed by God; (b) the product of necessity; (c) in reality profitable to us; (d) neither grievous nor unusual.

The first argument claims that all public evils form part of God's divine plan. They derive form the same source as all those profitable parts of nature and it would be impious to take only part of God’s creation and criticise Him for the remainder. We are born into God’s creation and it is our duty to obey Him by accepting all of His works. In any case, even if one does not follow God’s will freely, one will nevertheless be drawn along forcibly (echoing the famous Stoic donkey and cart analogy reported in Hippolytus Refutatio 1.21). Thus the only option is to obey God (deo parere).

The second argument claims that the continual cycle of creation and destruction are the inevitable consequence of the necessary laws of Nature. If even the stars in the heavens are subject to the processes of creation and destruction, then it is only natural that man-made cities will rise and fall, for "all things run into this fatal whirlpool of ebbing and flowing" (Const. 1.16). However Lipsius is careful here to distance himself from Stoic materialism and outlines four points where Stoic doctrine must be modified in the light of Christian truth (see the next section).

The third argument is merely a variation upon traditional Christian responses to the problem of evil. Those terrible things that happen must in some sense be good if they are part of God's divine plan and Lipsius attempts to show this by claiming that public evils constitute exercise (exercendi) for the good, correction (castigandi) for the weak-willed, and punishment (puniendi) for the bad.

The fourth argument focuses upon the particular public evils that Lipsius wanted to avoid, namely the religious civil wars in the Low Countries. He argues that these wars are neither particularly grievous nor uncommon. In order to place these present conflicts into perspective Lipsius, drawing upon his extensive classical learning, cites numerous examples of wars, plagues, and acts of cruelty from Jewish, Greek, and Roman history. The conflict from which Lipsius has fled is neither excessively brutal nor particularly unusual. What would be unusual would be an individual insulated and exempted from the cycles of birth and death, creation and destruction. It is the human lot to suffer at the hands of this continual change; the philosophical task, however, is to decide how one will face that suffering. One can do so either with sorrow (dolor) or with constancy (constantia).

v. Four Modifications of Ancient Stoicism

During the course of the second argument concerning the nature of public evils, Lipsius outlines four points where Stoicism and Christianity diverge. He is careful to distance himself from these parts of Stoic philosophy and the modification of Stoicism that he makes here (Const. 1.20) in order to reconcile it with Christianity forms the basis for the intellectual movement that has come to be known as Neostoicism. The four points in question are the Stoic claims that (a) God is submitted to fate; (b) that there is a natural order of causes (and thus no miracles); (c) that there is no contingency; (d) that there is no free will. All four of these points derive from the Stoic theory of determinism and it is this to which Lipsius primarily objects.

Stoic determinism is itself built upon Stoic materialism, which affirms that only bodies exist. These bodies act as causes and so anything that acts, including the soul, must be corporeal. Aulus Gellius reports that the Stoic Chrysippus defined fate as a natural and everlasting order of causes in which each event follows from another in an unalterable interconnection (Noctes Atticae 7.2.3). Thus, as Cicero notes, the Stoic doctrine of fate, conceived as an order and sequence of material causes, is "not the fate of superstition but rather that of physics" (De Divinatione 1.126). By rejecting this doctrine, Lipsius attempts to disengage the Stoic ethical ideas to which he is drawn from their foundations in Stoic physics. This is absolutely essential if he is to be able to present Stoic ethics in a form acceptable to a Christian audience.

vi. Summary

The central theme of De Constantia - that public evils are the product of the mind and thus must be treated rather than fled – contrasts sharply with Lipsius's own earlier behaviour when faced with the religious wars then raging. Perhaps experience had taught him that, no matter how many geographical moves he made, he would not be able to escape the evils surrounding him until he examined himself. Only wisdom and constancy – the products of philosophical reflection – can bring true peace of mind.

c. Later Stoic Works

De Constantia was not Lipsius's only work devoted to Stoicism. He also produced two studies of Stoic philosophy during the course of the preparation of his 1605 edition of Seneca; the Manuductio ad Stoicam Philosophiam ('Digest of Stoic Philosophy’) and the Physiologia Stoicorum (‘Physics of the Stoics’), both published in 1604. These works offer an interpretation of every aspect of Stoic philosophy and draw together under subject headings large numbers of quotations and doxographical reports preserved in a wide range of ancient authors. These two works may be seen as the precursors to the, now standard, edition of the fragments of the early Stoics compiled by Hans von Arnm (Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta, 1903-24).

These later studies of Stoicism - based upon a more systematic survey of the surviving sources – are marked by two features which distinguish them from De Constantia. The first is a more developed awareness of the systematic inter-relation between ethics and physics in Stoic philosophy; the second is a revised and more positive attitude towards the Stoic theory of determinism. In Phys. 1.12, for instance, Lipsius demonstrates a more thorough understanding of the Stoic theory of fate, and on the basis of this he suggests that it can in fact be reconciled with Christian doctrine without modification. In order to do this, he draws upon St. Augustine's discussion of Stoic definitions of fate in De Civitate Dei 5.8 where it is argued that fate does not impinge upon the power of God but rather is the expression of the will of God.

While De Constantia was a popular and highly readable dialogue, these later studies were primarily works of classical scholarship. They were conceived as supplementary volumes designed to complement - and perhaps even justify – Lipsius's final great work, his 1605 critical edition of the philosophical works of Seneca. This handsome folio edition included all of Seneca’s prose works, detailed summaries for each, commentary, and a biography of the great Roman Stoic. In this final publication, Lipsius’s admiration of Stoic philosophy and his talents as a classical philologist are united so as to form a highly appropriate culmination to his intellectual career.

4. Conclusion

Lipsius has been described as the greatest Renaissance scholar of the Low Countries after Erasmus. The role that he played in the revival of interest in Stoicism during the late Renaissance was similar to that performed by Marsilio Ficino with regard to Platonism and Pierre Gassendi with regard to Epicureanism. As such, he stands as a key figure in the history of Renaissance philosophy and the Renaissance revival of ancient thought.

5. References and Further Reading

a. The Works of Justus Lipsius

All of Lipsius's works are gathered together in his Opera Omnia of 1637. Another edition appeared in 1675. Full bibliographical details for all of his works can be found in F. Van Der Haeghen’s Bibliographie Lipsienne: Oeuvres de Juste Lipse, 2 vols (Ghent: Université de Gand, 1886).

i) Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex

  • Politicorum sive Civilis Doctrinae Libri Sex (Leiden: Plantin, 1589) - the first edition.
  • Sixe Bookes of Politickes or Civil Doctrine, Done into English by William Jones (London: Richard Field, 1594) - there is also a facsimile reprint of this edition (Amsterdam: Theatrum Orbis Terrarum, 1970).

ii) De Constantia Libri Duo

  • De Constantia Libri Duo, Qui alloquium praecipue continent in Publicis malis(Antwerp: Plantin, 1584) - the first edition.
  • Traité de la constance, Traduction nouvelle précédée d'une notice sur Juste Lipse par Lucien du Bois (Brussels & Leipzig: Merzbach, 1873) - still the most recent edition of the Latin text, with a facing French translation.
  • Two Bookes of Constancie Written in Latine by Iustus Lipsius, in English by Sir John Stradling, Edited with an Introduction by Rudolf Kirk (New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press, 1939) - the most recent edition in English, reprinting a translation first published in 1594.

iii) Later Stoic Works

  • Manuductionis ad Stoicam Philosophiam Libri Tres, L. Annaeo Senecae, aliisque scriptoribus illustrandis (Antwerp: Plaintin-Moretus, 1604) - extracts reprinted and translated into French in Lagrée (below) – extracts also translated into English in J. Kraye, ed. Cambridge Translations of Renaissance Philosophical Texts 1: Moral Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997), 200-09.
  • Physiologiae Stoicorum Libri Tres, L. Annaeo Senecae, aliisque scriptoribus illustrandis (Antwerp: Plantin-Moretus, 1604) - extracts reprinted and translated into French in Lagrée (below).
  • Annaei Senecae Philosophi Opera, Quae Existant Omnia, A Iusto Lipsio emendata, et Scholiis illustrata (Antwerp: Plantin-Moretus, 1605) - Lipsius's 'Life of Seneca’ and his summaries are translated by Thomas Lodge in his The Workes of Lucius Annaeus Seneca (London: William Stansby, 1620), which is based upon Lipsius’s edition.

b. Studies

  • ANDERTON, B., 'A Stoic of Louvain: Justus Lipsius', in Sketches from a Library Window (Cambridge: Heffer, 1922), 10-30.
  • GERLO, A., ed., Juste Lipse (1547-1606), Travaux de l'Institut Interuniversitaire pour l’étude de la Renaissance et de l’Humanisme IX (Brussels: University Press, 1988)
  • LAGRÉE, J., Juste Lipse et la restauration du stoïcisme: Étude et traduction des traités stoïciens De la constance, Manuel de philosophie stoïcienne, Physique des stoïciens (Paris: Vrin, 1994)
  • LAGRÉE, J. 'Juste Lipse: destins et Providence', in P.-F, Moreau, ed., Le stoïcisme au XVIe et au XVIIe siècle (Paris: Albin Michel, 1999), 77-93.
  • LAGRÉE, J. 'La vertu stoïcienne de constance', in P.-F, Moreau, ed., Le stoïcisme au XVIe et au XVIIe siècle (Paris: Albin Michel, 1999), 94-116.
  • LAUREYS, M., ed., The World of Justus Lipsius: A Contribution Towards his Intellectual Biography, Bulletin de l'Institut Historique Belge de Rome LXVIII (Brussels & Rome: Brepols, 1998)
  • LEVI, A. H. T., 'The Relationship of Stoicism and Scepticism: Justus Lipsius', in J. Kraye and M. W. F. Stone, eds, Humanism and Early Modern Philosophy (London: Routledge, 2000), 91-106.
  • MARIN, M., 'L'influence de Sénèque sur Juste Lipse’, in A. Gerlo, ed., Juste Lipse: 1547-1606 (Brussels: University Press, 1988), 119-26.
  • MORFORD, M., Stoics and Neostoics: Rubens and the Circle of Lipsius (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1991)
  • MORFORD, M. 'Towards an Intellectual Biography of Justus Lipsius - Pieter Paul Rubens', Bulletin de l’Institut Historique Belge de Rome 68 (1998), 387-403.
  • OESTREICH, G., Neostoicism and the Early Modern State, trans. D. McLintock (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982)
  • SAUNDERS, J. L., Justus Lipsius: The Philosophy of Renaissance Stoicism (New York: The Liberal Arts Press, 1955)
  • ZANTA, L., La renaissance du stoïcisme au XVIe siècle (Paris: Champion, 1914)

References to further works dealing with Neostoicism may be found at the end of the IEP article Neostoicism.

Author Information

John Sellars
Email: john.sellars (at)
University of the West of England
United Kingdom

Middle Knowledge

Luis de Molina

If Aristotle had not been a student of Plato, then would Aristotle have chosen to start his school at Lyceum? If you believe God knows the answer to this question, you probably believe God has middle knowledge.

Middle knowledge is a form of knowledge first attributed to God by the sixteenth century Jesuit theologian Luis de Molina (pictured to the left). It is best characterized as God’s prevolitional knowledge of all true counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. This knowledge is seen by its proponents as the key to understanding the compatibility of divine providence and creaturely (libertarian) freedom (see Free Will).

Middle knowledge is so named because it comes between natural and free knowledge in God's deliberations regarding the creative process. According to the theory, middle knowledge is like natural knowledge in that it is prevolitional, or prior to God's choice to create. This, of course, also means that the content of middle knowledge is true independent of God's will and therefore, He has no control over it. Yet, it is not the same as natural knowledge because, like free knowledge, its content is contingent. The doctrine of middle knowledge proposes that God has knowledge of metaphysically necessary states of affairs via natural knowledge, of what He intends to do via free knowledge, and in addition, of what free creatures would do if they were instantiated (via middle knowledge). Thus, the content of middle knowledge is made up of truths which refer to what would be the case if various states of affairs were to obtain.

Table of Contents

  1. Assumptions
  2. Scientia Media
  3. Objections to Middle Knowledge
    1. Rejection of Libertarian Freedom
      1. Libertarian Responses
    2. The Truth of Counterfactuals of Creaturely Freedom
      1. Objections to the Principle of Conditional Excluded Middle
      2. Molinist Responses
      3. Molinism and Determinism
      4. The Grounding Objection
      5. Molinist Responses
    3. The Usefulness of Middle Knowledge
      1. Viciously Circular
      2. Not True Soon Enough
      3. Molinist Responses
  4. References and Further Readings
    1. Books
    2. Articles

1. Assumptions

Before an examination of the theory of middle knowledge can be offered, several assumptions must be set forth. Each of these assumptions is important for an understanding of the doctrine of middle knowledge and its usefulness for theological reflection.

First, it is assumed that for an action to be free, it must be determined by the agent performing the action. This means that God cannot will a free creature to act in a particular way and the act still be free. Free actions must be self-determinative. This assumption may appear self-evident to some, and quite controversial to others. While it must be admitted that God could certainly desire a creature act in a particular way and the choice remain free, it is difficult to see how He could cause the choice and it still be free in a meaningful way. Proponents of middle knowledge do not deny that God may influence a free choice or persuade an agent to act in a particular way, but such influence and persuasion cannot be determinative if the action performed is to be free. In addition, middle knowledge requires freedom of a libertarian nature. That is, free creatures have the ability to choose between competing alternatives, and really could choose one or the other of the alternatives.

Second, it has become customary to speak of a logical priority in divine thoughts. This is not to deny the simplicity or omniscience of God, or to say that He gains knowledge that He did not previously possess. Rather, it is simply to acknowledge that dependency relationships exist between certain kinds of knowledge. It is also to acknowledge that something analogous to deliberation may take place in the divine mind. For example, in order for God to know that one plus one equals two, He must first comprehend the meaning of the concepts represented by the numbers, mathematical symbols, and formulaic expressions; they serve as a basis by which the truthfulness of the formula may be evaluated. But this is not to say that there was a time when God did not know 1+1=2. Thus, a relationship of logical priority, but not necessarily temporal priority exists between some of the content of divine knowledge.

Third, proponents of the doctrine of middle knowledge believe that things could have been different than they, in fact, are. There is much that is not necessary about the way the world is. For example, I could have married someone other than Stefana, the woman I did marry. Of course, that would depend upon my falling in love with someone else and that woman agreeing to my proposal of marriage. Although I find it difficult to imagine my falling in love with someone else (I love my wife very much), the point is that there is nothing about my marrying Stefana that is necessary. Stefana was free to reject my offer of marriage, I was free to never ask her out, we may never have existed, etc. Or, for another example, God could have made things differently. The sky could be yellow instead of blue, or the grass pink. God could have chosen to not create at all. Although this assumption should be self-evident, it is also supported by the Heisenberg Uncertainty Principle. Things could have been different.

2. Scientia Media

Molina's doctrine is called scientia media, or middle knowledge, because it stands in the middle of the two traditional categories of divine epistemology as handed down by Aquinas, natural and free knowledge. It shares characteristics of each and, in the logical order of the divine deliberative process regarding creation, it follows natural knowledge but precedes free knowledge.

Natural knowledge is that part of God's knowledge which He knows by His very nature or essence, and since His essence is necessary, so is that which is known through it. That is, the content of natural knowledge includes all metaphysically necessary truths. For example, the statement, "All bachelors are unmarried" is both necessary and part of natural knowledge. Other examples include other tautologies, mathematical certainties (e.g., 1+1=2), and all possibilities (since all possibilities are necessarily so). Natural knowledge can therefore be thought of as including a virtually infinite number of propositions of the form, It is possible that p, as well as a number of propositions of the form, It is the case that p. Thus, natural knowledge, properly conceived, is that part of God's knowledge which could not have been different from what it is. It follows from this fact that the content of God's natural knowledge is independent of His will; God has no control over the truth of the propositions He knows by natural knowledge. Consider, for example, the mathematical truth, 1+1=2. No matter what God wills, it will always be true that the concepts represented by the symbols 1, 2, +, and =, when arranged in a formulaic expression, one plus one equals two. It is important to note that, because natural knowledge is independent from God's will and, to some extent, places limits upon the kinds of things God can do, natural knowledge informs(ed) God's decision(s) regarding His creative work. This also means that natural knowledge is prevolitional.

Free knowledge is that part of God's knowledge which He knows by His knowledge of His own will, both His desires and what He will, in fact, do. The content of this knowledge is made up of truths which refer to what actually exists (or has existed, or will exist). For example, the statement, "John Laing exists," although certainly true, is dependent upon God's choice to create me (or, more properly, to actualize a world where I am brought about), and hence, is part of God's free knowledge. Free knowledge can therefore be thought of as including a number of propositions of the form, It is the case that p (Note that propositions of the forms, It was the case that p, and It will be the case that p, can be reduced to a proposition which refers to the present). Since free knowledge comes from God's creative act of will, two things follow. First, the content of that knowledge is contingent; it could have been different from what it, in fact, is. That is, free knowledge includes only metaphysically contingent truths, or truths that could have been prevented by God if He chose to create different situations, different creatures, or to not create at all. Second, free knowledge is postvolitional; it is dependent upon God's will.

As previously noted, middle knowledge is so named because it comes between natural and free knowledge in God's deliberations regarding the creative process. According to the theory, middle knowledge is like natural knowledge in that it is prevolitional, or prior to God's choice to create. This, of course, also means that the content of middle knowledge is true independent of God's will and therefore, He has no control over it. Yet, it is not the same as natural knowledge because, like free knowledge, its content is contingent. The doctrine of middle knowledge proposes that God has knowledge of metaphysically necessary states of affairs via natural knowledge, of what He intends to do via free knowledge, and in addition, of what free creatures would do if they were instantiated (via middle knowledge). Thus, the content of middle knowledge is made up of truths which refer to what would be the case if various states of affairs were to obtain. For example, the statement, "If John Laing were given the opportunity to write an article on middle knowledge for the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, he would freely do so," although true, is certainly not necessarily so. I could easily have refrained from writing, if I were so inclined (or too busy, etc.). Likewise, its truth does not seem to be dependent upon God's will in the same way that "John Laing exists" is. Even if God chose to not create me, the statement regarding my writing the article could still be true. In fact, its truth does not seem to be dependent upon God's will at all, but rather upon my will. One of the basic assumptions of the doctrine of middle knowledge outlined above is that God cannot will a creature to freely choose anything. Thus, the content of middle knowledge can be thought of as including a virtually infinite number of propositions of the form, If person, P, were in situation, S, then P would freely perform action, A (or P(S®A)).

The theory of middle knowledge presents a picture of divine omniscience which includes not only knowledge of the past, present and future, but also knowledge of conditional future contingents (propositions which refer to how free creatures will choose in various circumstances), counterfactuals (propositions which refer to how things would actually be if circumstances were different than they are or will be), and counterfactuals of creaturely freedom (propositions which refer to what a free creature would have chosen (freely) to do if things had been different). This knowledge, together with natural knowledge, informs God's decision about what He will do with reference to creation.

One of the most useful concepts for the explanation and evaluation of middle knowledge is that of possible worlds. The basic belief that things could have been different is commonly described as belief in many possible worlds. Each complete set of possible states of affairs (or way things could be) is a possible world, and although there is an extremely large number of possible worlds, it is not infinite (some states of affairs are impossible), and only one is actual (the way things are).

In the contemporary discussion of possible worlds, two concepts have proven particularly instructive: actualization and similarity. In popular piety, it is not unusual to refer to God creating the world. However, in possible worlds semantics, this is seen as semantically improper. Instead, God's creative activity should be referred to as creating the heavens and the Earth, but actualizing a particular possible world (since possible states of affairs do not have a beginning, which the language of creation implies). According to the doctrine of Molinism, God can actualize a world where His will is brought about by the free decisions of creatures, but in order to make this claim, contemporary Molinists have had to distinguish between strong and weak actualization. Strong actualization refers to the efforts of a being when it causally determines the occurrence of an event (e.g., God causes something to happen), while weak actualization refers to the contribution of a being to the occurrence of an event by placement of a free creature in circumstances in which he will freely cause the event. Weak actualization has proven to be a powerful tool for understanding the relationship between God's providence and human freedom. However, it must be noted that it implies that there may be some states of affairs that God cannot weakly actualize, which leads to the further conclusion that there may be some possible worlds that God cannot actualize.

A more controversial aspect of modern Molinism has been the use of possible worlds in determining the truth of counterfactuals. According to possible worlds semantics, a counterfactual is true in the actual world if it is true in the possible (but not actual) world that is most similar to the actual world. Not all Molinists have accepted this approach, noting the difficulty in determining comparative similarity among possible worlds.

3. Objections to Middle Knowledge

Much of the current discussion of middle knowledge has developed in the context of debate over the validity of the doctrine. Three basic objections to Molinism have been proffered: 1) Rejection of Libertarian Free Will, 2) The Truth of Counterfactuals of Creaturely Freedom, and 3) The Usefulness of Middle Knowledge for God's Creative Decision.

a. Rejection of Libertarian Freedom

The principle objection to middle knowledge in Molina's day was that it afforded creatures such a high view of freedom that God's providence was compromised. Although Molina’s detractors were certainly motivated by political concerns, the strength of their theological and philosophical arguments cannot be denied. Today, this form of argument normally takes one of two forms. First, some theologians/philosophers have objected to the assumption that God cannot will the free actions of creatures. This argument will often be based on an appeal to mystery or the transcendence of God. God, it is said, works on a plane above that of creatures, and therefore can will an action of an individual while not impinging on his freedom. Second, and more commonly, some have objected to the concept of libertarian freedom and instead advocate compatibilist freedom. Whereas libertarian freedom is seen as the ability to choose between competing alternatives, compatibilist freedom is seen as the ability to choose in accordance with one's desires. It is argued that libertarian freedom is radically indeterministic or even incoherent—if one's desires are not determinative for his decision, then it appears that no decision can be made.

i. Libertarian Responses

Proponents of libertarian freedom have responded that it is the individual's will which is determinative for the choice made. They have also pointed out that proponents of compatibilist freedom must believe that God possesses libertarian freedom in order to avoid theological fatalism: either God was able to choose to create or not create, for example, or He had to create. Since most theologians want to avoid the claim that God could always act in only one way, they must admit the coherence of libertarian freedom. At this point, then, the complaint with libertarian creaturely freedom can only be one of veracity—that it simply does not accurately explain the creaturely decision-making process. Proponents of libertarian freedom have pointed out that this claim cannot be proven, and that from an existential standpoint, it seems to be false. It should be noted that the majority of philosophers hold to libertarian freedom and these objections have been primarily entertained in the theological arena.

b. The Truth of Counterfactuals of Creaturely Freedom

The second type of objection to Molinism is really an attack on the belief, fundamental to the doctrine of middle knowledge, in counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. Many scholars have called into question the possibility that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom can be true. Various approaches have been taken to make this claim, from questioning the principle of conditional excluded middle, to arguing that true counterfactuals require determinism, to contending that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom have nothing which makes them true. Each will be presented, albeit only briefly.

i. Objections to the Principle of Conditional Excluded Middle

The first approach to arguing that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom cannot be true has come in the form of an attack on the principle of conditional excluded middle. The principle of conditional excluded middle states that, given two conditional statements with the same antecedent and opposite consequents, one must be true (Either p®q or p®~q). It is thought that Molinism requires the principle to hold because counterfactuals of freedom are often presented in pairs. For example, consider the following pair of conditional statements:

(1) If John were to ask Stefana to marry him, she would accept; and

(2) If John were to ask Stefana to marry him, she would not accept.

Although, properly speaking, these are not counterfactuals, since I did ask Stefana to marry me, in the literature it has become customary to speak of all conditional statements of this sort as counterfactuals. According to the doctrine of middle knowledge, one of either (1) or (2) must be true, and God knew which would be true prior to His free knowledge. However, if conditional excluded middle can be shown to be false, then the contention that one of a pair of counterfactuals must be true, cannot be sustained.

David Lewis has provided an example of two conditional statements which (he claims) seem equally true:

(3) If Verdi and Bizet were compatriots, Bizet would be Italian;

(4) If Verdi and Bizet were compatriots, Bizet would not be Italian.

It is unclear which statement is correct, yet according to CEM, one must be true. (3) could be true. After all, if Bizet were Italian, he and Verdi would be compatriots. However, (4) could also be true (if Verdi were French). It seems just as likely for Verdi to have been French as Bizet to have been Italian and therefore, neither (3) nor (4) is true. The principle of conditional excluded middle fails, and so does middle knowledge.

ii. Molinist Responses

Two basic responses have been offered by proponents of Molinism. First, some have questioned the accuracy of Lewis' contention that (3) is just as likely to be true as (4). In deciding which is true, a judgment call has to be made regarding the relative similarity of possible worlds to the actual world, a. Suppose (3) is true in a possible world, b, and b is more similar, or closer, to a than any other possible world in which (3) is true. Suppose further that (4) is true in a possible world, g, and g is closer to a than any other possible world in which (4) is true. According to the standard possible worlds semantics, (3) is true if b is closer to a than g is, and (4) is true if g is closer to a than b is. However, Lewis argues that b and g may be equally similar to a and therefore, neither (3) nor (4) is true—they have an equal chance of being true.

However, it seems that this is not the case—the inability to determine which possible world, b or g, is closer to the actual world, a, appears to be due more to a lack of knowledge about the actual world than genuine indeterminacy regarding similarity among worlds. It may also be due to a lack of criteria regarding how similarity among possible worlds is to be determined. Thus, the inability to determine which of (3) or (4) is true may be due to epistemological uncertainty rather than equal likelihood.

Second, it has been pointed out that middle knowledge does not require the principle of excluded middle, but rather only the principle of bivalence. Lewis' example does not present a problem for middle knowledge because the counterfactuals do not refer to creaturely activity and because two kinds of change are possible (Bizet could be Italian or Verdi could be French). In a counterfactual of creaturely freedom, only one sort of change is possible—either the creature performs the required action, or he/she does not. The only variable in the example given previously was Stefana's action in response to the proposal. She could either accept, or not accept. Since only one variable exists, only the principle of bivalence is necessary.

iii. Molinism and Determinism

The second approach to arguing that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom cannot be true has come in the form of an assertion that Molinism leads to determinism and therefore, the counterfactuals do not refer to free actions. Several forms of this argument have been offered.

The first form has been to question the amount of risk God takes. Since middle knowledge affords God comprehensive knowledge of the future (when taken with His free knowledge), and of how creatures will exercise their freedom when faced with decisions, and since that knowledge is used by God in determining how He will providentially guide the world, all risk on God's part is removed; He cannot be surprised and further, He specifically planned for everything that will occur. Yet, the objectors argue, true creaturely freedom requires risk on the part of God. Molinism removes the risk, but is doing so, abrogates creaturely freedom.

The most common response by Molinists to this form of the argument is simply that it begs the question of compatibilism. It is based on the questionable presuppositions that divine risk is necessary for creaturely freedom to exist, and that risk is eliminated by divine foreknowledge. But these presuppositions seem to assume incompatibilism (of creaturely freedom and divine foreknowledge), which is what the argument is supposed to prove. In addition, Molinists have also argued that it is dependent upon a particular view of risk that may be questioned as well.

The second form of the argument contends that the individual referred to in a counterfactual of creaturely freedom does not have the power to bring about the truth or falsity of that counterfactual and therefore, does not have the required freedom to perform, or not perform, the given action. The reason it is argued that individuals do not have the power to bring about the truth of counterfactuals about them is that some counterfactuals are true regardless of what the individual actually does. Consider the example given earlier in this article:

(1) If John were to ask Stefana to marry him, she would accept; and

(2) If John were to ask Stefana to marry him, she would not accept.

(1) is true, but according to this argument, Stefana does not bring about its truth because it is true whether or not she accepts. Suppose John never proposes—in that case, Stefana neither accepts nor rejects the offer because it was never made. That is, the counterfactual is true independent of Stefana's action and, therefore, she does not make it true. So, the argument goes, since Stefana does not have the power to bring it about that the counterfactual is true, then she does not have the power to bring it about that the counterfactual is false. But since the counterfactual is true, it seems that she therefore does not have the power to not accept the proposal if it is made and therefore, she is not free with respect to the marriage proposal.

The proponents of middle knowledge have responded to this form of the argument with a variety of answers, most of which are rather complex discussions of the concepts of individual power and entailment, relative similarity among possible worlds, and bringing about. The upshot of these arguments is that it is not at all clear (at least to the Molinists) that individuals do not have the power to bring about the truth (or falsity) of counterfactuals which refer to them. In fact, most Molinists have argued for the validity of the concept of counterfactual power over the past (power of an individual to act in such a way that certain things in the past would have been other than they were, if the person were going to act in that way, which they were not).

The third form of the argument builds upon the first and the second, specifically with reference to the way that God makes use of middle knowledge and the fixity of the past. Since God's knowledge of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom informs His decision about which possible world to actualize, that knowledge and the true counterfactuals are part of the causal history of the actual world and therefore, are part of the fixed past. The problem this causes for Molinism is due to the fact that genuine freedom requires that the individual has the ability to either act in the specified manner or not act in the specified manner. In other words, if God considered (1) in his decision regarding actualization of this world, once He did actualize this world (in which (1) is true), then (1) became part of the history of this world and part of the fixed past. This leads to the suggestion that Stefana did not really have the ability to not accept the offer of marriage, if John were to propose (that is, to bring it about that (2) is true instead of (1)).

Molinists have responded to this objection by denying the central claim that events which had causal consequences in the past are hard facts about the past. Most Molinists believe that free agents have counterfactual power over the past (power to act such that, if one were to act in that way, the past would have been different from how it, in fact, was). If this sort of power is accepted as plausible, then the objection fails.

iv. The Grounding Objection

The third approach to arguing that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom cannot be true is the most popular and seems to serve as the basis for the other objections. It is typically referred to as the "grounding objection," and is related to the question already posed regarding what causes counterfactuals to be true. According to the argument, there appears to be no good answer to the question of what grounds the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. They cannot be grounded in God because determinism would follow—the necessity of God's being or His will would transfer to the counterfactuals. Additionally, the prevolitional character of middle knowledge speaks against grounding counterfactuals of creaturely freedom in the will of God. However, they also cannot be grounded in the individuals to which they refer for at least four reasons. First, counterfactuals of creaturely freedom are true prior to the existence of the individual to which they refer. Second, the existence of the individuals is dependent upon the will of God, and therefore, the truth of the counterfactuals would also be dependent upon the will of God (which has already been shown to be problematic). Third, counterfactuals, properly speaking, refer to non-actual states of affairs and therefore, the events to which they refer never happen, and fourth, psychological makeup cannot serve as grounding because this suggests that the actions performed are not free and thus, the propositions describing the decisions/actions cannot be deemed counterfactuals of freedom.

v. Molinist Responses

Molinists have responded to the grounding objection in a variety of ways, five of which will be surveyed here. The first response to the grounding objection has been to simply state that counterfactuals of freedom do not need to be grounded and that no satisfactory explanation of the grounding relation can be given. The upshot of this response is that counterfactuals of creaturely freedom seem to be brute facts about the possible worlds in which they are true or brute facts about the creatures to whom they refer.

The second response is similar in that it turns the grounding objection against the detractor of middle knowledge. Some of the proponents of middle knowledge have suggested that the grounding objection is based on the assumption that a causal connection must exist between the antecedent and consequent of a counterfactual of creaturely freedom in order for it to be true. This assumption, however, is problematic because it assumes libertarian freedom to be false. The grounding objection, then, begs the question of compatibilism.

The third Molinist response has been to compare contingent propositions which refer to the actual future (or futurefactuals) with contingent propositions which refer to counterfactual states of affairs, specifically regarding statements which include how free creatures will decide and would have decided. Those propositions which refer to the actual future are either true or false now, even though there is nothing in the present that can be pointed to as grounding their truth. In a similar fashion, counterfactuals are either true or false, even though there is nothing in the present that can be pointed to as grounding their truth.

The fourth response by proponents of middle knowledge builds upon the third and utilizes the standard possible worlds semantics. It may be argued that the truth of futurefactuals of creaturely freedom are grounded in the future occurrence or nonoccurrence of the event. In a similar fashion, the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom may be grounded in the occurrence or nonoccurrence of the event in the closest possible-but-not-actual world to the actual world. Thus, there is something (an event) that may be pointed to as grounding the truth of the statement.

The fifth and final response of Molinists has been to build upon the suggestion that counterfactuals are brute facts about particular individuals, by arguing that the truth of counterfactuals are grounded in the individuals to which they refer as they exist in the precreative mind of God as ideas. Since the grounding is in the individual, contingency remains, yet since it is as the individual exists in the mind of God as an idea, the problems associated with grounding in the individual are avoided.

Although some of these responses may be deemed more successful than others, and while some may be seen as more of a shifting of the burden of proof than an answer to the specific objection, they do demonstrate that the demand for grounding is somewhat unclear. However, it must also be conceded that the efforts to answer the objection show that some sort of idea of grounding is at least conceivable.

c. The Usefulness of Middle Knowledge

The third major objection to middle knowledge is similar to the second in that it deals with the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom. Several forms of this argument have been proffered, but in its most basic form, it claims that the priority inherent in the Molinist system creates a problem for the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom—the verdict is that Molinist is either viciously circular, or counterfactuals of creaturely freedom are not true soon enough to aid God's creative decision.

i. Viciously Circular

Proponents of this objection point out that, according to Molinism, the truth of counterfactuals of creaturely freedom must be prior to God's creating activity because they inform His creative decision. However, under the standard possible worlds analysis, which counterfactuals are true is dependent upon which world is actual (counterfactuals are true if they are true in the closest possible-but-not-actual world to the actual world). Thus, which world is actual (and presumably, how close all possible worlds are to it) must be prior to God's knowledge of the true counterfactuals. But this means that God’s creative decision must be prior to God's creative decision! Thus, middle knowledge is circular.

ii. Not True Soon Enough

A variation on this same argument ignores the possible worlds approach to determining counterfactual truth and instead begins with the view that a counterfactual is true by the action of the agent named in the counterfactual. This, however, also leads to a problem because it means that a truth regarding how the agent would act must be prior to the agent's activity (presupposed in Molinism), but because the agent is free, he could refrain from acting and thereby cause the counterfactual to be false. Therefore, the truth of counterfactuals must be "up in the air" until the agent acts. But this means that God could not use counterfactuals of creaturely freedom to aid His creative decision because they would not be true soon enough for Him to use them (or if they were, the agents named could not refrain from acting and therefore, would not be free).

iii. Molinist Responses

A whole host of answers have been presented by Molinists. The most obvious response is to reject the possible worlds analysis of counterfactuals—disallow the contention that the truth of counterfactuals is somehow dependent upon which world is actual. Other responses have included discussion of the use of "priority" or the “depends on” relation in the two arguments. In both cases, it appears that an equivocation has taken place. Last, both versions of the argument betray an assumption of the incompatibility of libertarian creaturely freedom and divine foreknowledge.

4. References and Further Readings

a. Books

  • Craig, William Lane. Divine Foreknowledge and Human Freedom: The Coherence of Theism, Omniscience. New York: Brill, 1990.
  • Craig, William Lane. The Problem of Divine Foreknowledge and Future Contingents from Aristotle to Suarez. New York: Brill, 1988.
  • Flint, Thomas P. Divine Providence: The Molinist Account.. Ithaca: Cornell, 1998.
  • Hasker, William. God, Time, and Knowledge. Ithaca: Cornell, 1989.
  • Molina, Luis de. On Divine Foreknowledge: Part IV of the Concordia. Translated by Alfred J. Freddoso. Ithaca: Cornell, 1988.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. The Nature of Necessity. Oxford: Clarendon, 1974.

b. Articles

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. "An Anti-Molinist Argument" In Philosophical Perspectives, vol. 5, Philosophy of Religion, ed. by James E. Tomberlin, 343-53. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview, 991.
  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. "Middle Knowledge and the Problem of Evil." American Philosophical Quarterly 14:2 (April 1977): 109-17.
  • Hasker, William. "Middle Knowledge: A Refutation Revisited." Faith and Philosophy 12:2 (April 1995): 223-36.
  • Hasker, William. "A New Anti-Molinist Argument." Religious Studies 35:3 (September 1999): 291-97.

Author Information

John D. Laing
Southwestern Baptist Theological Seminary
U. S. A.

Renaissance Humanism

The time when the term "Humanism" was first adopted is unknown. It is, however, certain that both Italy and the re-adopting of Latin letters as the staple of human culture were responsible for the name "Humanists." Literoe humaniores was an expression coined in reference to the classic literature of Rome and the imitation and reproduction of its literary forms in the "new learning"; this was in contrast to and against the Literoe sacroe of scholasticism. In the time of Ariosto, Erasmus, and Luther, the term umanisa was in effect an equivalent to the terms "classicist " or " classical scholar."

Table of Contents

  1. Italian Humanism
  2. Character of the Movement
  3. Erasmus

1. Italian Humanism

Dante had an admiration for ancient letters. At first, he intended to compose his great epic in Latin verse. Petrarch considered his Africa a fair effort to reproduce Vergil. In the exordium of his chief work Petrarc h appeals to the Heliconian Sisters as well as to Jesus Christ, Savior of the world. He also reviews the epics of Homer (although he never learned Greek), Statius, and Lucan. He was overwhelmed with the friendships of many prestigous men of his day, a mong whom Cardinal Stephen Colonna was prominent. Petrarch is the pathfinder as well as the measure of the new movement. He idealized the classical world. His classicist consciousness and his Christian consciousness are revealed in his writings. Th e experiences of life constantly evoke in him classic parallels, reminiscences, associations. Julius Caesar, Papirius Cursor, are nostri, "our people"; Pyrrhus, Hannibal, Massinissa are externi, "foreigners." His epistles provide the b est revelation of his soul. Of course, the craving for pure Latinity and the elevation of such practical power of imitation and reproduction involved an artificiality of which neither Petrarch nor his successors were aware. Boccaccio was not only a hu manist, but he, with appalling directness, revealed the emancipation of the flesh as one of the unmistakable trends of the new movement. Both he and Poggio, Valla, Beccadelli, Enea Silvio dei Piccolomini (in his youth) show that the hatred of the cle rical class instigated literary composition. At the same time in the caricatures of foulness which these leaders of the new learning loved to draw, there is no moral indignation, but clearly like satyrs they themselves relish these things. For this reason the Humanists of Italy, as such, were not at all concerned in the efforts for a reformation of the church as attempted in the councils of Constance or of Basel. Poggio, apostolic secretary, came to Constance with the pope, but spent most of his time in ransacking the libraries of Swiss monasteries for Latin codices. The defense of Jerome of Prague before the Council reminded him of Cato of Utica. His correspondent Lionardo Bruni at Florence warns him to be more circumspect in his praise of a heretic. In the Curia itself a semipagan spirit was bred by the Humanists. In 1447 Parentucelli, an enthusiast for codices, became pope as Nicholas V. On Easter, the eminent humanist Filelfo wrote to him from Milan to congratul ate him on his elevation. Filelfo expressed a general satisfaction of scholars, citing also the humanitas of Christ himself, as well as writing somewhat hypocritically of fucata gentilium . . . sapientia. Some time later, in 1453, Filelfo personally appeared at the papal court. Nicholas kept the vile "Satyrae" of the humanist until he had perused them, and gave Filelfo a purse of 500 ducats when he departed. Enea Silvio de' Piccolomini ascended the papal throne in 1458 as Pius II., another humanist pope.

2. Character of the Movement

A very clear view of the Humanistic movement may be gained from the writings of the biographer and beneficiary of Leo X., Paul Giovio (Jovius). In his Elogia (Antwerp,1557) he presents a gallery of literary scholar s, beginning with Dante, and including Petrarch, Boccaccio, Bruni, Poggo, Beceadelli (the pornographic poet), Valla, Filelfo, Platina, the Greeks Emanuel Chrysoloras, Cardinal Bessarion, Trapezuntius the Cretan, Theodorus Gaza, Argyropulos, Chalcondyla s, Musurus of Crete, and Lasearis. Also, he gives us Lorenzo de'Medici, Ermolao Barbaro, Politian, Pico di Mirandola, and even Savonarola. But Savonarola's attacks on Pope Alexander VI., father of Cesare and Lucrezia, are treated as treason and felon y. The Platonic academy of Ficinus at Florence had certainly no power to regenerate the political and moral corruption of its patron Lorenzo. Bibienna, the favorite of Leo X., was witty at banquets; at Leo's court this cardinal produced his lascivio us comedy, "Colandra," because Terence was too grave. Even Thomas More and Reuchlin are included. Among the latter's academic friends were the anonymous composers of the satiric Epistoloe obscurorum virorum-the flail of the new learning swung ag ainst the old. The Italian Humanists were not concerned in the reformatory movements of the fifteenth century. They drifted into a palpable paganism or semipaganism, curiously illustrated in the verse, e.g., of Politian, especially his Greek verse, a nd of him even the lax Giovio writes: "he was a man of unseemly morals. "They all more or less emphasized "vera virtus" by which they meant "true excellence," the self-wrought development of human faculties and powers. Still they knew how to ma intain friendly relations with those higher clerics who had resources with which to patronize the new learning. They often accepted clerical preferment, as did Gievio, who became bishop of Nocera. Often the Latin verse of their youth proved very awkw ard when they entered upon their benefices. All were more interested "in viewing the early monuments of sensual enjoyment" than in study of the New Testament. As they greatly exceeded the corruption of the clergy in their own conduct, they could not take any practical interest in any spiritual or theological reformation. In all the correspondence of Filelfo, extending from 1428 to 1462, there is but once or twice a slight (deistic) utterance of spiritual concern, when, in the siege of Milan by Francesco Sforza, 1449, the ducal city endured terrible sufferings. Jacob Burckhardt says of the Humanists that they were demoralized by their reproduction of Latin verse. But why did they delve in Ovid, Catullus, and the like with steady predilection? At best a mild deism or pantheism may be perceived in their more serious writings. Greek, on the whole, was a rare attainment among them, reproductive ostentation limited most of them to Latin.

3. Erasmus

Erasmus of Rotterdam in his person and career marks the point where the "new learning" had arrived at the parting of the ways. He felt an affinity for Lucian; his Encomium Morioe, a vitriolic satire, dealt not gently with clerical corruption. He edited the New Testament and dedicated it to Leo X. He had no desire to abandon the old Church, considering the bounties and pensions which he received were all derived from princes or clerics who adhered to the papacy. He pretended that he could not read the German writings of Luther. Erasmus wrote that "Luther's movement was not connected with learning," and, at the same time he wrote to Pope Hadrian VI.: "I could find a hundred passages where St. Paul seems to teach the doctrines which they condemn in Luther. "Other utterances show his unwillingness to serve the Reformation or to be held responsible for any part of it: I have written nothing which can be laid hold of against the established orders. . . . I would rather see things left as they are than to see a revolution which may lead to one knows not what. Others may be martyrs, if they like. I aspire to no such honor. . . . I care nothing what is done to Luther, but I care for peace. . . . If you must take a side, take the side which is most in favor." His keen sense of actual dependencies in the movement of things led him to see situations and realities with wonderful clearness; but his genius, like that of many scholars, was essentially negative. When he was fifty-one, not long before 1517, he wrote to Fabricius at Basel: "My chief fear is that with the revival of Greek literature there may be a revival of paganism. There are Christians who are Christians but in name, and are Gentiles at heart." In the fall of 1525, when central Germany had been affected by the Peasants' War, he wrote: "You remember Reuchlin. The conflict was raging between the Muses and their enemies, when up sprang Luther, and the object thenceforward was to entangle the friends of literature in the Lutheran business, so as to destroy both them and him together."

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