Category Archives: Epistemology

Knowledge Norms

Epistemology has seen a surge of interest in the idea that knowledge provides a normative constraint or rule governing certain actions or mental states. Such interest is generated in part by noticing that fundamentally epistemic notions, such as belief, evidence, and justification, figure prominently not only in theorizing about knowledge, but also in our everyday evaluations of each others’ actions, reasoning, and doxastic commitments. The three most prominent proposals to emerge from the epistemology literature have been that knowledge is the norm of assertion, the norm of action, and the norm of belief, though we shall consider other proposals as well.

‘Norm’ here is often, but not always, understood as a rule which is intimately related to the action/mental state type in question, such that this relationship is a constitutive one: the action or mental state is constituted (in part) by its relationship to the rule. Typically such views argue for a norm of permission such that knowledge is required, as a necessary condition, for permissibly acting or being in the relevant mental state: in schematic form, one must: X only if one knows a relevantly specified proposition. Some philosophers also endorse a sufficiency condition as well, so that knowledge is necessary and sufficient for (epistemic) permission to X, such that one must: X if and only if one knows a relevantly specific proposition. Such views put knowledge to work in elucidating normative concepts, practical rationality, and conceptual priorities in epistemology, mind, and decision theory. This article outlines the growing literature on these topics.

Table of Contents

  1. Knowledge Norm of Assertion
    1. Problem Sentences: Moore’s Paradox
    2. Conversational Patterns
    3. Rivals and Objections
    4. Sufficiency
  2. Knowledge Norm of Action
    1. Knowledge and Practical Reasoning
    2. Knowledge and Reasons
    3. Sufficiency and Pragmatic Encroachment
  3. Knowledge Norm of Belief
    1. The Belief-Assertion Parallel
    2. Knowledge Disagreement Norm
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Knowledge Norm of Assertion

Assertion is the speech act we use to make claims about the way things are: in English, asserting is the default speech act for uttering a sentence in the indicative or declarative mood, such as when one tells someone, “John is in his office” (for an overview of assertion, including ways of characterizing it that do not make essential appeal to epistemic norms, see MacFarlane 2011).  The recent literature on the norms of assertion has concentrated on whether there is a rule governing the speech act of assertion which specifies a necessary condition for making the speech act permissible on that occasion; section 1.D below briefly discusses the idea of a sufficient condition for permissible assertion. The view has its roots in the work of philosophers who argued that when one asserts, claims, or declares that p (which are to be distinguished from simply uttering “p”) one somehow thereby represents oneself as knowing that p, even though p itself may not refer to the speaker’s knowledge at all (see Moore 1962: 277; Moore 1993: 211; Black 1952; and Unger 1975: 251ff.). The idea that when one asserts that p one represents oneself as knowing that p—call this position ‘RK’—enabled an explanation of certain problem sentences and conversational patterns.

a. Problem Sentences: Moore’s Paradox

G.E. Moore noted the paradoxical nature of asserted conjunctions where one affirms a proposition but also denies that one believes it or that one knows it. Conjunctions such as (1) and (2), he said, sound “absurd” (Moore 1942: 542-43; 1962: 277):

(1)   Dogs bark, but I don’t believe that they do.

(2)   Dogs bark, but I don’t know that they do.

The order of the conjuncts does not matter to their absurdity, as (3) and (4) make clear (Moore 1993: 207):

(3)   I don’t believe that dogs bark, but they do.

(4)   I don’t know that [whether] dogs bark, but they do.

What captured Moore’s interest about such asserted sentences is that they could be true and yet it seems incoherent to state that truth: “It is a paradox that it should be perfectly absurd to utter assertively words of which the meaning is something which may quite well be true—is not a contradiction” (Moore 1993:  209). Moore’s own diagnosis of their absurdity appeals to something like RK, namely that “by asserting p positively, you imply, though you don’t assert, that you know that p” (1962: 277). So in asserting one of (1) – (4), one asserts, in one conjunct, a proposition and thereby also represents oneself as knowing it; but one also denies, in the other conjunct, that one knows it (or believes it, entailed by knowing it), thus generating a contradiction between what one claims (that one doesn’t know) and what one represents as being the case (that one does know).

b. Conversational Patterns

Peter Unger (1975) pointed to certain conversational patterns which seem to support RK, because RK well-explains them. One of these concerns the common use of the question “How do you know?” in response to someone’s assertion: such a question may be used to elicit clarification about why one is flat-out asserting, but importantly, it also may be used to challenge someone’s assertion. What is more, it is rare that this question is condemned as out of line in response to an assertion. Such questions are appropriate even though an asserter has said nothing at all about knowing what she’s asserted, and an asserter cannot acceptably answer such questions by claiming that she never claimed that she knew it. And an asserter who concedes with “I don’t know,” or modifies her original assertion by moving to “I believe p” or “I think p” or “Probably p” will normally be taken to be retreating from her original outright assertion that p: she has instead replaced her claim with a weaker one. RK explains all these points (Unger 1975: 263-64; cf. also Slote 1979).

Timothy Williamson (1996; 2000, Ch. 11), provides a fuller defense of the view, and pointed to further conversational patterns explained by RK. Williamson’s account replaces RK with the Knowledge Norm of Assertion, sometimes called the ‘Knowledge Account of Assertion’, which says that

(KNA) One must: assert that p only if one knows that p

KNA can be thought of “as giving the condition on which a speaker has the authority to make an assertion. Thus asserting p without knowing p is doing something without having the authority to do it, like giving someone a command without having the authority to do so” (2000: 257). Williamson thinks of KNA as constitutive of the speech act of assertion, conceived of by analogy with the rules of a game: just as the rules of chess are essential to it in that they constitute what the game is and what it is to play chess, so Williamson thinks of the speech act of assertion as constituted by its relation to KNA. In this sense, mastering the speech act of assertion involves implicitly grasping this norm and the practice which it governs (2000: 241); indeed, the speech act plausibly functions to express one’s knowledge (Turri 2011).  If this is correct, KNA would explain RK, a descriptive fact about what speakers who assert represent about themselves: for it is in virtue of engaging in a practice whose norm we all implicitly grasp that one would represent oneself as conforming to that norm. (For helpful discussion of Williamson’s approach to constitutivity, see Turri 2014a; for an account on which the KNA is derived from a more fundamental norm of intellectual flourishing, see Brogaard 2014.)

Williamson notes that in addition to the “How do you know?” question which can be used to implicitly challenge one’s authority to assert, the stronger challenge question “Do you know that?” explicitly challenges one’s authority, and the dismissal “You don’t know that!” rejects one’s authority. KNA explains this range of aggressiveness (Williamson 2000: 253; 2009: 344). Turri (2010) further points out that there is an asymmetry between the acceptability of certain kinds of prompts to assertion:

(5) Do you know whether p?

(6) Is p?

are typically interchangeable as prompts to an assertion, and the flat-out assertion “p” serves to answer each equally well; but certain stronger questions, such as “Are you certain that p?” typically cannot be used, as can (5) and (6), as an initial prompt for assertion, whereas weaker prompts such as “Do you think that p?” or “Do you have any idea whether p?” seem to request something weaker than a flat-out assertion (perhaps a hedged assertion or a prediction), are thereby not interchangeable with (5) and (6). Related to this data is that a standard response when one feels not well-positioned to assert, in reply to a prompt like (6), is to answer “I don’t know.” The appropriateness of the “I don’t know” response is telling given that the query was about p, not about whether one knows that p. Thus KNA seems confirmed by these data.

In addition to prompts and challenges, and our responses to them, there is data from lottery assertions (Williamson 2000: 246-252, Hawthorne 2004: 21-23). Many people find it somehow inappropriate for people to flat-out assert of a particular lottery ticket (before the draw has been announced) that it will lose, even though given a large enough lottery its losing is overwhelmingly probable. Many also find it plausible that one does not know that such a ticket will lose. KNA proponents aim to explain the first point in terms of the second: the reason it is inappropriate for one to make such lottery assertions, absent special knowledge about the lottery being rigged, is that one does not know that the ticket will lose.

Benton (2011) and Blaauw (2012) also point to peculiar facts about the parenthetical positioning of “I know” in assertive sentences, which seem well-explained by KNA. Notice that “I believe” (or “I think,” or “probably”) can occur in assertive constructions to hedge one’s assertion, and syntactically they can occur in prefaced or utterance-initial position (7), parenthetical position (8), or utterance-final parenthetical position (9), with each sounding as good as the other:

            (7) I believe that John is in his office.

            (8) John is, I believe, in his office.

            (9) John is in his office, I believe.

Yet with “I know,” (10) sounds perfectly in order, but (11) and (12), while coherent, can seem oddly redundant:

            (10) I know that John is in his office.

            (11) ?  John is, I know, in his office.

            (12) ?  John is in his office, I know.

KNA is able to explain why: if flat-out assertions express one’s knowledge, or represent one as knowing, it will be expressively redundant to add to it that one knows (where (10) is not redundant because it seems to be the amplified claim that: one knows that John’s in his office). However this explanatory argument from KNA of such data as been critiqued as incomplete or inadequate (see McKinnon & Turri 2013, McGlynn 2014).

Finally, knowledge seems to be connected to assertion in parallel with its connection to showing someone how to do something: in the same way that knowing that p seems to be required for permissibly asserting that p, knowing how to X seems to be required for permissibly showing someone how to X.  In this sense, knowing is the pedagogical norm of showing, for structurally parallel considerations to the linguistic data discussed above (Moorean conjunctions, challenges, prompts, etc.) is available for pedagogical contexts (Buckwalter & Turri 2014).

In short, KNA claims to offer the best explanation of these data from Moorean conjunctions, challenges, prompts, responses to prompts, lottery assertions, parenthetical positioning, and pedagogical norms.

c. Rivals and Objections

Though KNA has been widely defended, its opponents offer substantial criticism and suggest rival accounts requiring other epistemic or alethic conditions: most rival norms of assertion appeal to justified or reasonable or well-supported belief, or that it be reasonable or credible for one to believe, or that one's assertion be true.

Williamson (2000: 244-249) considered a Truth Norm to be the most significant rival to KNA. Because knowledge is factive, the KNA requires its assertions to be true; but according to the Truth Norm, one must assert that p only if p is true (a further norm requiring evidence for p would be derivable from the requirement of truth), and thus is less demanding than the KNA. Weiner (2005) argues for a Truth Norm by noting that cases of prediction and retrodiction seem to be counterexamples to KNA, that is, they are assertions which seem intuitively acceptable even though the propositions affirmed are not known. Weiner further argues that the Truth Norm can rely on Gricean pragmatic resources to explain the data from lotteries and Moorean conjunctions, for the Truth Norm on its own does not predict the inappropriateness of such assertions. While Weiner (2005) and Whiting (2013) argue for truth as necessary and sufficient for the epistemic propriety of assertion, Littlejohn (2012) and Turri (2013b) argue (compatibly with the KNA) that truth is necessary for epistemically proper assertion; Littlejohn’s defense of factivity focuses on the requirement that assertions about what a subject ought to do would have to satisfy the truth requirement to be properly asserted, whereas Turri’s draws on experimental investigation of people’s judgments of false assertions. For criticisms of Weiner’s Truth Norm, see Pelling (2011) and Benton (2012). A related norm is that proposed by Maitra and Weatherson (2010): they argue that a certain class of statements, namely those concerned with what is “the thing for one to do,” form an important exception to the KNA. Their rival norm, the Action Rule, says “Assert that p only if acting as if p is true is the thing for you to do” (2010: 114). They argue that their Action Rule collapses into the Truth Norm for propositions concerning what one should do (“if an agent should do X, then that agent is in a position to say that they should do X,” 2010: 100), though it does not do so for other propositions.

Douven (2006) argues for a Rational Credibility Norm, and Lackey (2007) argues for a Reasonable-to-Believe Norm; for related norms, see also McKinnon’s (2013) Supportive Reasons Norm. These views roughly hold  that to be epistemically acceptable, an assertion that p need not be known, but must be credible or reasonable for the speaker to believe, even if it is not actually believed by the speaker. Douven’s approach argues for that his norm is as adequate as the KNA in explaining most of the linguistic data canvassed above, but that his Rational Credibility norm is a priori simpler than, and so preferable to, the KNA (cf. Douven 2009 which updates some of his arguments). Lackey’s influential discussion argues for this view by suggesting that cases of selfless assertion are intuitively acceptable. Selfless assertions involve cases in which an asserter possesses knowledge-worthy evidence, appreciates the strength of that evidence, yet for non-epistemic reasons fails to believe that p (and asserts that p anyway). Thus on Lackey’s particular account, the speaker need not even believe what is asserted (for criticism of Lackey’s view, see Turri 2014b). Because these norms sanction lottery assertions and Moorean assertions, Douven and Lackey both attempt to explain away the impropriety attending to such assertions.

Kvanvig (2009, 2011a) argues for a Justified Belief Norm; somewhat related is Neta’s (2009) Justified-Belief-that-One-Knows Norm. These norms require, for permissible assertion, a justified belief of some kind, either that the asserter justifiably believe what is asserted, perhaps even knowledge-level justification; or that the asserter hold the higher order justified belief that she knows what she’s asserted (the latter of which will, on many views, itself require that she justifiably believe the asserted proposition). These norms do not actually require an assertion to be true, and thus their proponents have to explain the apparent defect in a false assertion, even if one is largely absolved from blame given that that one was justified in believing what was asserted (for discussion see Williamson 2009: 345). Similarly, Coffman (2014) argues for a Would-Be Knowledge Norm, which is stronger than a justified belief norm in that it requires not only knowledge-level justification, but also that the belief not be Gettiered. This norm also, however, does not require truth, for one might have a false belief which (given one’s knowledge-level justification) would be knowledge if only it were true.

Another rival approach is a context-sensitive norm of assertion which accepts that an epistemic norm governs assertion, but claims that its content can vary according to context. There are different ways of formulating such an account. On Gerken’s (2012) view, the epistemic norm of a central type of assertion is internalist norm of “Discursive Justification,” according to which an asserter must be able to articulate reasons for her belief in the proposition asserted. This approach is context-sensitive in that what counts as adequate reason-giving will vary according to context (for other norms of assertion that impose primarily ‘down stream’ requirements on the speaker, see also Rescorla 2009 and MacFarlane 2009: 90ff.).

Goldberg (2009, 2011) initially applied the KNA to issues in the epistemology of testimony. More recently, Goldberg (2015) formulates and defends a context-sensitive norm on which knowledge is often required for permissible assertion—perhaps knowledge is even the default value—but in other contexts justification or reasonable belief might be enough, and in still other contexts, perhaps something even stronger than knowledge is required (certainty, perhaps). Goldberg draws on Grice’s (1989) maxim of quality, according to which assertions are governed by the first supermaxim and its two submaxims:

Quality: Try to make your contribution one that is true.

    1. Do not say that which you believe to be false.
    2. Do not say that for which you lack adequate evidence. (1989, 27)

Grice’s quality maxim, invoking as it does the notion of ‘adequate’ evidence, would seem to be just such a context-sensitive norm (though see Benton 2014a, for reasons to doubt this). Goldberg’s hypothesis is that there is Mutually-Manifest Epistemic Norm of Assertion (MMENA), which is comprised of a norm (ENA), and the context-sensitive mechanism (RMBS) which fixes the epistemic condition required by ENA:

ENA   S must: assert p, only if S satisfies epistemic condition E with respect to p, i.e., only if S has the relevant warranting authority regarding p.

RMBS  When it comes to a particular assertion that p, the relevant warranting authority regarding p depends in part on what it would be reasonable for all parties to believe is mutually believed among them (regarding such things as the participants’ interests and informational needs, and the prospects for high-quality information in the domain in question) (Goldberg, 2015, Chap. 12)

McKinnon’s (2013) Supportive Reasons Norm is designed to be similarly context-sensitive, and on a natural reading, Lackey’s Reasonable-to-Believe Norm can be understood this way as well; Stone (2007: 100-101) also prefers, but does not develop, a kind of context-sensitive norm opposed to the KNA. Such rival norms have the intuitive benefit of explaining a great range of conversational contexts in which we assert seem to acceptably; however with this flexibility comes the burden of having to provide plausible explanations of the data, considered in sections I.A and I.B above, which invoke knowledge.

Note however that opting for a context-sensitive norm need not mean that one eschews the KNA. DeRose (2002; 2009 Chap. 3) accepts a version of KNA, but regards “know(s)” as semantically context-sensitive. Thus the standard for the truth of “knowledge” ascriptions at a context sets the standard for permissible assertion: for a given speaker S in a conversational context C, the truth conditions for “S knows that p” at C are the assertibility conditions for S to assert that p in C. On this view, knowledge remains the norm of assertion. Relatedly, Schaffer (2008) argues for a contextualist version of KNA which he claims supports contrastivism about knowledge.

Many of the rival norms to KNA are motivated in part by the idea that KNA is just too strong an epistemic requirement on assertion: many KNA opponents find it implausible to think that one has done anything wrong by asserting what one doesn’t know, so long as one’s assertion, or one’s decision to assert p, is supported in the relevant way by adequate evidence or reasons for p (see McGlynn 2014 for a thorough discussion). Some of these objections to KNA come from appeals to intuitions about cases, in particular, cases in which one asserts with strong grounds or evidence, but one is in a Gettier situation, or what one asserts is unluckily false. In general, such cases appeal what are judged to be blameless assertion (for concerns about relying on such judgments of blame, see Turri & Blouw 2014). Some proponents of KNA respond that in such cases one asserts reasonably if one reasonably took oneself to know, even though on KNA, one still asserts impermissibly: its being reasonable is what excuses one for having violated the norm, and the plausibility of calling it an ‘excuse’ suggests that a norm was violated (Williamson 2000: 256; DeRose 2009: 93-95, Sutton 2007: 80, Hawthorne & Stanley 2008: 573, 586); but this excuse maneuver has been heavily criticized for multiplying senses of propriety or for being too general (Lackey 2007, Gerken 2011, Kvanvig 2011a). See also Littlejohn 2012 and 2014 for extensive discussion of the notion of excuse, as related to these norms.

Other opponents of the KNA are particularly motivated to preserve the acceptability of our assertive practices within special contexts which are nevertheless familiar and ones in which it seems that we do assert, such as the philosophy seminar room (see Goldberg, 2015). Still others rely on intuitions about cases and a desire to give a normative role to the hearer of an assertion (see Pelling’s 2013b “knowledge provision” account). Some express skepticism at the very idea of there being a constitutive epistemic norm of assertion in Williamson’s sense, preferring instead the idea that more general norms of cooperation and rationality (perhaps those given by Grice) will suffice to explain any normativity in our practice of saying and asserting (e.g. Cappelen 2011; see Benton, 2014a, and Montgomery 2014 for discussion). Maitra (2011) in particular presents a challenge to Williamson’s way of formulating the notion of constitutive rules on analogy with the rules of a game. Yet the general idea that a constitutive epistemic norm can individuate speech acts has been deployed for other speech acts on the assertive spectrum: Turri (2013) thereby individuates the stronger speech act of guaranteeing, and Benton & Turri (2014) individuate the speech act of prediction.

The final rival to the KNA considered here is a Certainty Norm (Stanley 2008), on which to assert that p one must be (subjectively) certain that p. This norm is motivated in part by the idea that the Moorean conjunction schemas

(13)  p but I’m not certain that p

(14)  p but it is not certain that p

strike many to be just as problematic as the knowledge and belief conjunctions (1)-(4) considered above; a Certainty Norm could explain them, and if certainty is required for knowledge, it could also explain (1)-(4). However, the Certainty Norm inherits the ‘too strong’ objection with which many charge KNA, and as noted above, certainty does not figure in both prompts and challenges to assertions (Turri 2010). Also, it is unclear how the Certainty Norm will handle the truth desideratum insofar as conversational participants generally seem to care about truth, and not just a speaker’s confidence, in assertion.

d. Sufficiency

Even if KNA can seem to impose an overly demanding condition on the propriety of assertion, on first pass it might seem that knowledge at least provides a sufficient condition on epistemically permissible assertion. After all, this idea goes, even if some epistemic/alethic standard weaker than knowledge is necessary for permissible assertion, nevertheless surely having knowledge is sufficient.  Most of the rivals to KNA ought to agree that when one knows, one thereby arguably meets the less stringent standards of: truth, it being reasonable/credible to believe, being justified in believing, and (if the contextually set standards for certainty do not easily come apart from those of knowledge) being certain enough to assert. Thus some of KNA’s defenders (cf. Hawthorne 2004: 23 n. 58, and 87; DeRose 2009: 93), and many of its opponents, could be tempted to endorse a sufficiency direction of the knowledge norm, such as the following: 

(KNA-S)  One is properly epistemically positioned to assert that p if one knows that p.

(As shall be seen below in section 2.c, similar sufficiency principles, tying knowledge to action, undergird pragmatic encroachment views of knowledge.)

But Lackey (2011, 2013) has argued that in fact, KNA-S is false (compare Pelling 2013a for another argument). She appeals to cases of what she calls isolated second-hand knowledge to show that in some settings, particularly those involving experts, asserting even though one knows is epistemically deficient. Consider a case in which an oncologist has referred her patient for lab tests, which arrive back on her day off. She must meet with the patient to provide the diagnosis, if any, and is only able to confer briefly with the oncologist from the lab about what the diagnosis is (that he has pancreatic cancer). The doctor can learn from her colleague’s testimony that her patient has pancreatic cancer, but this knowledge is isolated (she knows no other facts about the test results or the diagnosis), and entirely second-hand (via testimony with the lab oncologist). Given her epistemic situation, Lackey argues, it is intuitively (epistemically) impermissible for the doctor to assert to her patient that he has pancreatic cancer, even though she knows this. More generally, for experts asserting as experts, it seems that asserting with merely isolated second-hand knowledge is (epistemically) improper, because experts ought to engage their expertise first-hand, or ought to have more than isolated knowledge gained entirely through expert testimony. Thus Lackey argues that KNA-S is false. (See Carter & Gordon 2011 for an appeal to the idea that understanding is needed. For a challenge to Lackey’s cases, see Benton 2014b; for her reply, see Lackey 2014.)

2. Knowledge Norm of Action

Knowledge seems intimately connected to our reasons for, and our evaluations of, action. Recently many philosophers have endorsed normative connections between knowledge and action, and have deployed principles according to which knowledge is either necessary, sufficient, or both necessary and sufficient for appropriate action. Some of these discussions are focused on action as the result of practical reasoning, or on the connection between knowledge and reasons, or on knowledge as a sufficient epistemic position for acting on a proposition. We will consider these in turn.

a. Knowledge and Practical Reasoning

Some philosophers have noticed intuitive connections between knowledge, assertion, and practical reasoning (see Fantl & McGrath 2002; Hawthorne 2004, esp. 21-32, and Ch. 4; Stanley 2005; and Hawthorne & Stanley 2008).  Many thus argue that knowledge plays an important normative role in practical reasoning: when one faces a decision over whether to act that depends on the truth of some proposition, then acting without knowing that proposition can seem epistemically suspect and deserving of criticism. We often invoke knowledge when justifying someone’s decision to act, and we often cite their lack of knowledge when censuring others for acting on inadequate grounds; knowledge figures in our appraisals of blame, negligence, and in conditional orders wherein one is commanded to X just in case one knows a specified condition to obtain.

These facts support the idea that one ought only to use known propositions as premises in one’s practical deliberations. For example, if you opt against purchasing very affordable health insurance, on the grounds that you are plenty healthy, you may be criticized by your loved ones precisely because you do not know that you will not soon fall gravely ill. To take another example: suppose that you spent a dollar on a lottery ticket in a 10,000 ticket lottery with a $5,000 prize, and you are deliberating about whether to sell your ticket. Suppose you reason as follows:

The ticket is a loser.

So if I keep the ticket, I will get nothing.

But if I sell the ticket, I will get a penny.

So I should sell the ticket. (Hawthorne 2004: 29, 85)

Such reasoning should strike us as unacceptable and a plausible reason for why is that the first premise isn’t known. Similarly, suppose that someone offered to sell you their ticket in the same lottery for a cent: if you decline on the basis that you know their ticket will lose, that may also strike us as the wrong basis for declining, for it seems (to many) that you don’t know the ticket will lose. Indeed, if you do know the first premise, standard decision theory validates the reasoning; this suggests that only one’s beliefs which amount to knowledge should figure in to shaping one’s decision table (cf. Weatherson 2012).

These kinds of considerations suggest the following necessary direction norm, Action-Knowledge Principle (AKP), which gives a necessary condition on appropriately treating a proposition as a reason for acting:

(AKP)  Treat the proposition that p as a reason for acting only if you know that p (Hawthorne & Stanley 2008: 578)

AKP plausibly lies behind our epistemic evaluations of actions, and also provides a nice diagnosis of some comparative intuitions about low stakes vs. high stakes cases (e.g. Stanley 2005, 9-10).

A parallel debate concerns the idea that there is a common epistemic norm—say, knowledge, or perhaps epistemic ‘warrant,’ or justification—which provides a necessary condition on both appropriate assertion in particular and appropriate action/practical reasoning more generally: see Brown 2011 and 2012, Montminy 2013, Gerken 2013. As we will see in the next section, a structurally similar question concerns whether a common epistemic norm governs practical reason as well as theoretical reason (that is, on what one can appropriately take as a reason for believing).

Some important criticisms of AKP are the following. First, as with the KNA above, it doesn’t license acting on p when one holds a justified belief that p; indeed, one might be Gettiered with respect to p (see Brown 2008, Neta 2009). Acting on p in such cases seems to many to be entirely appropriate, and thus these are counterexamples to AKP. As with the KNA, the reply (Hawthorne & Stanley 2008: 573-74, 586) is that such subjects are blameless for making an excusable mistake, and the need for an excuse is explained by AKP.

Second, it has been objected that AKP doesn’t license acting on subjective probabilities of a proposition, and thus that it can seem in conflict with Bayesian decision theory. Sometimes one is only in a position to treat propositions that are probable for one as reasons for acting; Cresto (2010) argues that when probabilistic talk is interpreted in subjectivist terms, AKP can be violated even though it seems as though one has done nothing wrong. On standard Bayesian decision theory, one plugs one’s probabilities, along with one’s values for possible outcomes, into one’s decision table to discern the act which maximizes expected utility.  If you assign 0.7 probability to (have 0.7 credence in) the proposition that it will rain, and on that basis choose to carry an umbrella on your walk, have you violated AKP? Perhaps not, for if you know that you assign 0.7 probability to it raining, and use this knowledge as your reason for acting, then you do not violate AKP: the proposition that you treat as your reason for so acting is that rain is 0.7 probable (Hawthorne & Stanley 2008: 580-583). Arguably, one’s credences are not always luminous to one, and thus there is still a role for knowledge (and thus AKP) to play. Weatherson (2012) argues that the role for knowledge in decision theory is that it sets the standard for what gets on to one’s decision table; moreover, it might be that one’s credences can constitute knowledge (Moss 2013), and if so there is room for AKP to govern actions based on them. But still, it might be implausible to suppose that every such case of appropriately acting on a probability involves your knowing what your credence is: though your credence in it may be 0.7 on this occasion, this may not be transparent to you. It may be sufficient for you to act on the more coarse-grained probability that it’s more likely than not that it will rain, even if you do not form the belief that it is more likely than not that will rain. On this way of looking at things, the objection remains. For important constructive work adjudicating these issues and proposing some ways in which a knowledge norm for practical reasoning and Bayesian decision theory are compatible, see Weisberg (2013).

b. Knowledge and Reasons

We standardly cite reasons as propositions which ought to make a difference to someone’s decision to act one way or another. Such normative reasons are reasons there are for a particular agent to believe, feel, or act a certain way. (Such reasons are distinguishable from both explanatory reasons—reasons why an agent believed or felt or acted—and from motivating reasons—reasons for which an agent acted in a particular way.)  Normative reasons can be either possessed by an agent or not possessed by an agent: if Iris is at the bar and there is petrol in the glass in front of her, then there is a reason for her not to drink the liquid in her glass, but it will not be a reason Iris possesses unless she is aware that there is petrol in the glass.

A natural way to approach the connection between knowledge and action is by noting that possessing a reason for some action arguably depends on knowing a proposition, and that lacking knowledge can rob one of possessing the relevant reason (see Hyman 1999, Unger 1975, Ch. 5, Alvarez 2010, and Littlejohn 2014). If Iris knows that there is petrol in the glass, then that is a reason she possesses to refrain from drinking it; but if she does not know it, then she does not possess that reason to refrain, even though there is a reason for her to refrain. There being petrol in the glass can only be a reason Iris possesses if she knows it.

This view connects naturally with the above discussion of the normative relation between knowledge and action: where one treats a proposition as one’s reason for action, and then acts for that reason, one only acts properly when one knows that proposition. This is because, on the view being considered, one cannot possess p as a reason to ϕ unless one knows that p. Of course, one’s motivating reason for ϕ-ing might be a falsehood: one might falsely believe that q and thereby take q as one’s reason for ϕ-ing, and one’s belief that q explains why one ϕ’d. On the view being considered then, one cannot in that circumstance have had q as a reason, for one cannot (because q is false) know that q. That is, the reasons one takes to be one’s reasons can come apart from the reasons one in fact possesses. If this is correct, it has consequences for how to understand the normative concept of justification. In particular, knowledge figures importantly in understanding what reasons justify one in believing or in acting, such that the mark of justification is not an internalist or subjectivist notion of rationality but instead an externalist or objectivist notion explicable in terms of facts or knowledge of facts. See Littlejohn (2014) for more.

Some philosophers question the claim, crucial to the above line of reasoning, that one can possess p as a reason, or properly treat p as a reason for acting, only if p is true (and known). Comesaña and McGrath (2014) call this “factualism about reasons-had,” and against it they argue that one can have false reasons (see also Schroeder 2008, Fantl & McGrath 2009: 100-104, and Dancy 2014, among others).  The case for the possibility of having false reasons is built primarily upon two ideas. First, it seems to them that ascribing a reason to someone for their action can be done even if that reason is (or entails) a false proposition. That is, they claim that one could acceptably say of someone that “The reason she turned down the job was that she had another job offer,” even if she did not have another job offer and the speaker knows this. Second, when someone acts on a mistaken belief, there is pressure to claim that she acted for the same reason as she would’ve had her belief in fact been true. On this way of looking at things, there must be the same psychological state that rationalizes Iris’s taking and drinking from the glass with petrol in it as would (counterfactually) rationalize Iris’s taking and drinking from a glass with gin and tonic in it; in other words, such views take what it is that rationalizes to be what it is that provides ones with reasons, both motivating and normative: one has the same normative reasons in both the good and bad cases. Such views are at odds with the standard semantics about schemas such as “S’s reason for X-ing was/is that p” or “The reason S had for X-ing was that p”, which entail that p and so are factive; see Comesaña and McGrath (2014) for ways of handling these semantic issues.

As noted in the last section, there is a parallel question about whether the epistemic norm governing practical reason is the same as that governing theoretical reason. Hawthorne & Stanley’s AKP is a knowledge norm on practical reason, but they also note the analogous principle regarding reasons for belief:

(TKP) Treat the proposition that p as a reason for believing q only if one knows that p. (2008, 577)

Littlejohn (2014) notes a compelling argument that AKP is true just in case TKP, and that more generally, whatever epistemic status norms practical reason must also norm theoretical reason. The argument for it goes thus. Suppose (for reductio) that in fact, the norm for theoretical reason were less epistemically demanding than that for practical reason: for concreteness, suppose that one could treat p as a reason for believing that q only if one were justified in believing that p, but that knowledge still governed practical reason along the lines suggested by AKP.  In that case, if you justifiably believe that this liquid is gin, and you knew that you ought (if you can) to make another round of drinks for your guests, you could take your justified belief that it is gin as your reason for believing that: you can make them another round of drinks. But AKP says that you may treat that latter proposition (that you can make them another round of drinks) as a reason only if you know it; and let’s suppose you don’t know it, because in fact it’s not gin but petrol. In this situation, though it’s proper for you to treat your justified belief as a reason to form another belief, AKP says that you cannot properly treat this new belief as a reason for acting, namely making another round of drinks. If the epistemic norms diverged in this way, they would “demand that you were akratic,” and this seems absurd (Littlejohn 2014: 135-136). Things go similarly if the divergence goes the other way, namely if the norm of theoretical reason were more demanding than the norm of action: together these would permit situations in which one can act on a proposition (say, because one justifiably believes it), but not use it as a premise from which to deduce, and form beliefs in, other propositions. Thus there is a case for the unity thesis that a single epistemic status governs both practical and theoretical reasoning, even if it is not knowledge; for arguments that it is something weaker than knowledge, like justification or warrant, see Gerken (2011).

c. Sufficiency and Pragmatic Encroachment

Though Fantl & McGrath question the necessary direction principles AKP, they and others do endorse and defend sufficiency direction principles on which knowledge of a proposition is sufficient to rationalize acting on that proposition. Hawthorne & Stanley (2008, 578) defend a biconditional principle which adds to AKP a sufficiency direction, given a choice one faces which depends on a particular proposition. Where a choice between options X1... Xn is “p-dependent” just in case the most preferable of X1... Xn conditional on the proposition that p is not the same as the most preferable of X1... Xn conditional on the proposition that not-p, the Reason-Knowledge Principle (RKP) says:

(RKP) Where one’s choice is p-dependent, it is appropriate to treat the proposition that p as a reason for acting just in case one knows that p.

RKP gives necessary and sufficient conditions for appropriately treating a proposition as a reason for acting. Similarly Fantl & McGrath (2002, 2009, 2012) defend at length a variety of sufficiency conditions tying knowledge to action:

(Action) If you know that p, then if the question of whether p is relevant to the question of what to do, it is proper for you to act on p.

(Preference) If you know that p, then you are rational to prefer as if p.

(Inquiry) If you know that p, then you are proper not to inquire further into whether p.

(KJ)         If you know that p, then p is warranted enough to justify you in ϕ-ing, for any ϕ.

On the face of them, these principles can seem exactly right: for example, it might seem obvious that if one knows a proposition, then one is in good enough position to act upon it. But these principles admit of modus tollens as well: if it is not proper for one to act on p, or rational to prefer as if p, or proper to close off inquiry regarding p, or where p is not warranted to enough for one to act, for any action one considers undertaking, then one does not know that p. These principles bear out the intuitive judgments of many about such cases: to the extent that one’s epistemic position in some p seems inadequate when facing a decision that depends on that p, to that same extent we tend to be inclined to deny that one knows that p. That is, in cases where the practical stakes for one make it irrational for one to act on a proposition, such principles entail that one does not know that proposition (even though in other contexts where one faces no such decision, where one has the same evidence or is in the same “epistemic” position, one might know that proposition). Thus such views endorse “pragmatic encroachment” in epistemology (also known as “subject-sensitive invariantism” in Hawthorne 2004: Ch. 4, Brown 2008, and DeRose 2009), for practical considerations can seem to encroach on whether one knows. See Neta 2009 and Kvanvig 2011b for some criticisms, and Fantl & McGrath 2012 for arguments that pragmatic encroachment isn’t only about knowledge.

3. Knowledge Norm of Belief

a. The Belief-Assertion Parallel

Some philosophers (going back to at least Frege, Peirce, and Ramsey) find plausible the idea that belief or judgment amount to a kind of “inner assertion” where (full) belief is the inner analogue to outward (flat-out) assertion. For those inclined to this view who also accept the Knowledge Norm of Assertion, there is a motivation to accept a parallel Knowledge Norm of Belief. Williamson gestures at this idea thus:

It is plausible, nevertheless, that occurrently believing p stands to asserting p as the inner stands to the outer. If so, the knowledge rule for assertion corresponds to the norm that one should believe p only if one knows p. Given that norm, it is not reasonable to believe p when one knows that one does not know p. (2000, 255-56)

Adler (2002: 276ff.) calls this idea the “Belief-Assertion Parallel,” and offers a range of considerations suggesting that belief and assertion are on a par in this way.

Note however, that this Parallel is likewise intuitive should one prefer some kind of evidential or justification norm, rather than a knowledge norm, on both assertion and on belief. If, epistemically speaking, one shouldn’t assert to others that p without some sufficient evidence or justification for p, then one shouldn’t (epistemically speaking) believe that p without some similar sufficient evidence or justification for p; and in reverse, if (epistemically speaking) one shouldn’t believe that p without some sufficient evidence or justification for p, then one shouldn’t (epistemically speaking) assert to others that p without some similar sufficient evidence or justification for p. Thus to the extent that one finds the epistemic standard for assertion to be similar, if not identical, to the epistemic standard for belief, to that extent the Belief-Assertion Parallel will seem intuitive. Only if one takes the standard for one to be higher than the standard for the other will one be motivated to reject the Belief-Assertion Parallel. (For in-depth discussion, see Goldberg 2015, Chs. 6 and 7.)

Though Williamson does not formulate it explicitly, taking a cue from his KNA schema would provide us with a similar formulation for a Knowledge Norm of Belief, which gives a necessary condition for the propriety of belief:

(KNB) One must: believe p only if one knows p.

(Compare Sutton 2005, 2007; for clarification of how best to understand a norm like KNB, see Jackson 2012.) In addition to the inner/outer parallel noted above, Williamson also provides a different consideration in favor of KNB, one that invokes teleological considerations concerning the “aim” of belief:

If believing p is, roughly, treating p as if one knew p, then knowing is in that sense central to believing. Knowledge sets the standard of appropriateness for belief. That does not imply that all cases of knowing are paradigmatic cases of believing, for one might know p while in a sense treating p as if one did not know p—that is, while treating p in ways untypical of those in which subjects treat what they know. Nevertheless, as a crude generalization, the further one is from knowing p, the less appropriate it is to believe p. Knowing is in that sense the best kind of believing. Mere believing is a kind of botched knowing. In short, belief aims at knowledge (not just truth). (Williamson 2000, 47)

Notice that the KNB provides an elegant and unified account of Moore’s Paradox at the level of belief, a desideratum of many approaches to theorizing about Moore’s Paradox (e.g. Sorenson 1988): these authors note that while the sentences (1)-(4), uttered assertively, are absurd, it also seems absurd to believe (the propositions of) any of their conjuncts together. Huemer (2007) argues explicitly for the idea that theorizing about Moorean conjunctions in this way should lead us to accept both KNA and KNB.

Sosa (2010/2011, Chap. 3: 41-53) provides an interesting argument for another version of the Belief-Assertion Parallel, which arrives at norms similar to KNA and KNB, but he does so by explicit appeal to teleological considerations about the aim of belief. Sosa argues for what he calls the Affirmative Conception of Belief (2011: 41; cf. Sosa 2014):

Consider a concept of affirming that p, defined as: concerning the proposition that p, either (a) asserting it publicly, or (b) assenting to it privately.

With this Affirmative Conception in hand, he then applies considerations from the propriety of means-end action in general to the action of assertion as a special case, using the terminology of his virtue-theoretic epistemology (cf. Sosa 2007):

If one asserts that p as means thereby to assert that p with truth, this essentially involves the relevant means-end belief. I mean the belief that asserting that p is a means to thereby assert that p with truth. And this belief is equivalent to the belief that p. Accordingly, if that means-end belief needs to amount to knowledge in order for the means-end action to be apt, then in order for a sincere assertion that p to be apt, the agent must know that p. In this way, knowledge is a norm of assertion. If an assertion (in one’s own person) that p is not to fall short epistemically it must be sincere, and a sincere assertion that p will be apt only if the subject knows that p. This is, moreover, not just a norm in the sense that the subject does better in his assertion that p provided he knows that p. Rather, if his assertion is not apt, it then fails to meet minimum standards of performance normativity. Any performance (with an aim) that is inapt is thereby flawed. … Knowledge is said to be necessary for proper assertion … If knowledge is the norm of assertion, it is plausibly also the norm of affirmation, whether the affirming be private or public. (2011: 48)

Sosa goes on to develop an intriguing argument for the “equivalence” of the knowledge norm of assertion and the value-of-knowledge thesis (2011: 49-52). For a related view tying the norms of belief and assertion to a virtue-theoretic account, see Wright (2014).

Instructive here is Bach’s combination of views (Bach & Harnisch 1979, Bach 2008). Bach holds a Belief Norm of Assertion, on which the only norm fundamental to assertion is that assertions must be sincere (one must outright believe what one flat-out asserts), but he also holds a Knowledge Norm of Belief much like KNB (2008: 77). Because Bach accepts the KNB, he gets a derived version of the KNA: for one must believe only what one knows, but given his Belief Norm of Assertion, one must assert only what one believes; thus one must assert only what one knows, if one is believing as one ought. This combination of views is one which accepts KNB, accepts (the derivative) KNA, but which denies the Belief-Assertion Parallel at the level of what norms are constitutive of assertion and of belief.

An objection to the KNB, similar in spirit to objections to KNA considered above, is that many find it implausible to hold that one is doing epistemically poorly, or doing anything epistemically impermissible, by believing many propositions which we nevertheless do not know, and which we furthermore properly take ourselves not to know. For some important criticisms of KNB, stemming from arguments that there is nothing epistemically problematic or improper about lottery propositions, see McGlynn (2013, 2014). Relatedly, while most find it incoherent or irrational to believe the Moorean conjunction form (1) considered above, many find it unproblematic to believe some conjunctions of the form (2), namely believing a proposition and also believing that one does not know that proposition. Those who object to KNB on these grounds tend to deny a parallel between the epistemic standard for belief and the epistemic standard for knowledge. Couched in evidential terminology, many epistemologists intuitively think of belief in terms of an evidence-threshold model, according to which the evidential threshold which one must meet in order permissibly belief some proposition is lower than the evidential threshold for knowledge: more evidence is required to know than to (permissibly) believe.

b. Knowledge Disagreement Norm

In a spirit related to considerations stemming from endorsement of the KNB, Hawthorne & Srinivasan (2013) argue for a Knowledge Norm of Disagreement. In the growing literature on the epistemology of disagreement, debate ensues over what one should do in the face of disagreement about some proposition, particularly when those disagreeing with one are regarded as one’s intellectual or evidential peers. Typically such cases of peer disagreement are formulated such that you have formed a belief or a judgment on (or assigned a credence to) some proposition p, and have done so on the basis of some evidence: perhaps it is a judgment about which of two horses won a very close race, and the evidence is visual; or perhaps it is a judgment about what you and your friend each owe from calculating your share of a restaurant bill which you are splitting, in which case the evidence is intellectual and inferential. Many philosophers writing on such cases of disagreement are “conciliationists” of one sort or another, that is, they endorse the idea that in some such disagreements, one does something improper or irrational if one does not either suspend judgment on p, or reduce one’s credence in p. Opposed to conciliationists are “dogmatists” who advocate the idea that in face of such disagreements, it is sometimes appropriate or rational for one to hold steadfast or “stick to one’s guns” by retaining one’s belief or one’s credence.  (See essays in Feldman & Warfield 2010, and Christensen & Lackey 2013 for more.)

Hawthorne & Srinivasan (2013: 11-12), drawing on a knowledge-centric epistemology which takes knowledge to be the central goal of our epistemic activity, articulate a position which is in some ways a middle ground between these two views. They argue for the following Knowledge Disagreement Norm:

(KDN)  In a case of disagreement about whether p, where S believes that p and H believes that not-p:

(i) S ought to trust H and believe that not-p iff were S to trust H, this would result in S’s knowing not-p

(ii) S ought to dismiss H and continue to believe that p iff were S to stick to her guns this would result in S’s knowing p, and

(iii) in all other cases, S ought to suspend judgment about whether p.

KDN’s ‘ought’ clauses are motivated by a ranking of actions according to their counterfactual outcomes: according to KDN’s clause (i), one should be ‘conciliatory’ in the face of disagreement just in case trusting one’s disagreeing interlocutor would result in one gaining knowledge, whereas according to clause (ii), one should be ‘dogmatic’ in the face of disagreement just in case would lead to retaining one’s knowledge. Finally, in cases where neither party knows whether the proposition under dispute is true, each should suspend judgment.

Notice that KDN, formulated in the terminology of knowledge and outright belief, is neutral on the matter of how to respond when the ‘disagreement’ concerns divergences in credences toward a proposition: its clause (iii) is capable of accommodating many different approaches here. Further, KDN is fully general in that it does not hold only for cases of peer disagreement: its clauses (i) and (ii) are designed to capture the appropriateness of occasions in which someone defers to an expert or someone in a better evidential position, and thereby can come to know by trusting them. If it is plausible to suppose that becoming apprised of peer disagreement can defeat one’s knowledge, then such cases may be subsumed to clause (iii) (2013: 13-14, 21ff). Finally, KDN has the merit that, if followed, knowledge will tend to be maximized for all parties to a disagreement: if we disagree, but by trusting you, I can come to know what you believe, I ought to do so.

It may be objected that KDN is not easily followed, precisely because knowledge is a non-luminous condition, that is, one is not always in a position to know when one knows; and this is particularly pressing in the case of disagreement, for it is clear that (at least) one of the disagreeing parties doesn’t know, and it can be utterly unclear to most such disputants which one (if any) knows. This objection, and similar objections that are occasionally pressed against the norms of assertion and practical reasoning covered in earlier sections, seems to assume that norms must be perfectly operationalizable, that is, they must be such that one is always in a position to know whether one is complying with them (Williamson 2008). On this idea, a norm N, which requires that one X in circumstances C, will be perfectly operationalizable just in case S can know she is in C, and is thus in a position to reason that, given that she is in C, and could X by A-ing, and that N says she ought to X in C, that S ought to A. But it is a substantive question whether norms are or must be perfectly operationalizable; and given that many such conditions of epistemological interest are arguably non-luminous (see Williamson 2000: Ch. 4), one might reconsider the worth of that assumption. For more discussion of this issue and how it relates to the hypological categories of praise and blame, see Hawthorne & Srinivasan (2013: 15-21).

4. References and Further Reading

  • Adler, Jonathan. 2002. Belief’s Own Ethics. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Alvarez, Maria. 2010.  Kinds of Reasons. Oxford University Press.
  • Bach, Kent, and R. Michael Harnish. 1979. Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Bach, Kent. 2008. “Applying Pragmatics to Epistemology.” Philosophical Issues 18: 68-88.
  • Benton, Matthew A. 2011. “Two More for the Knowledge Account of Assertion.” Analysis 71: 684-687.
  • ­­­­­Benton, Matthew A. 2012. “Assertion, Knowledge, and Predictions.” Analysis 72: 102-105.
  • Benton, Matthew A. 2014a. “Gricean Quality.” Noûs.
  • Benton, Matthew A. 2014b. “Expert Opinion and Second-Hand Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.
  • Benton, Matthew A. and John Turri. 2014. “Iffy Predictions and Proper Expectations.” Synthese 191: 1857-1866.
  • Blaauw, Martijn. 2012. “Reinforcing the Knowledge Account of Assertion.” Analysis 72: 105-108.
  • Black, Max. 1952. “Saying and Disbelieving.” Analysis 13: 25–33.
  • Brogaard, Berit. 2014. “Intellectual Flourishing as the Fundamental Epistemic Norm.” In Clayton Littlejohn and John Turri (eds.), Epistemic Norms: New Essays on Action, Assertion, and Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brown, Jessica. 2008. “Subject-Sensitive Invariantism and the Knowledge Norm for Practical Reasoning.” Noûs 42: 167-189.
  • Brown, Jessica. 2010. “Knowledge and Assertion.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 81: 549-566.
  • Brown, Jessica. 2011. “Fallibilism and the Knowledge Norm for Assertion and Practical Reasoning.” In Jessica Brown and Herman Cappelen (eds.), Assertion: New Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Brown, Jessica. 2012. “Assertion and Practical Reasoning: Common or Divergent Epistemic Standards?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 84: 123-157.
  • Buckwalter, Wesley and John Turri. 2014. “Telling, Showing, and Knowing: A Unified Theory of Pedagogical Norms.” Analysis 74: 16-20.
  • Cappelen, Herman. 2011. “Against Assertion.” In Jessica Brown and Herman Cappelen (eds.), Assertion: New Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Carter, J. Adam and Emma Gordon. 2011. “Norms of Assertion: The Quantity and Quality of Epistemic Support.” Philosophia 39: 615-635.
  • Christensen, David and Jennifer Lackey (eds.). 2013. The Epistemology of Disagreement: New Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Coffman, E.J. 2014. “Lenient Accounts of Warranted Assertability.” In Clayton Littlejohn and John Turri (eds.), Epistemic Norms: New Essays on Action, Assertion, and Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Comesaña, Juan and Matthew McGrath. 2014. “Having False Reasons.” In Clayton Littlejohn and John Turri (eds.), Epistemic Norms: Assertion, Action, and Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cresto, Eleonora. 2010. “On Reasons and Epistemic Rationality.” Journal of Philosophy 107: 326-330.
  • Dancy, Jonathan. 2014. “On Knowing One’s Reason.” In Clayton Littlejohn and John Turri (eds.), Epistemic Norms: Assertion, Action, and Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • DeRose, Keith. 2002. “Assertion, Knowledge, and Context.” Philosophical Review 111: 167-203.
  • DeRose, Keith. 2009. The Case for Contextualism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Douven, Igor. 2006. “Assertion, Knowledge, and Rational Credibility.” Philosophical Review 115: 449-485.
  • Douven, Igor. 2009. “Assertion, Moore, and Bayes.” Philosophical Studies 144: 361-375.
  • Fantl, Jeremy and Matthew McGrath. 2002. “Evidence, Pragmatics, and Justification.” Philosophical Review 111: 67-94.
  • Fantl, Jeremy and Matthew McGrath. 2009. Knowledge in an Uncertain World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fantl, Jeremy and Matthew McGrath. 2012. “Pragmatic Encroachment: It’s Not Just about Knowledge.” Episteme 9: 27-42.
  • Feldman, Richard and Ted Warfield (eds.). 2010. Disagreement. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Goldberg, Sanford C. 2009. “The Knowledge Account of Assertion and the Nature of Testimonial Knowledge.” In Patrick Greenough and Duncan Pritchard (eds.). Williamson on Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Goldberg, Sanford C. 2011. “Putting the Norm of Assertion to Work: The Case of Testimony.” In Jessica Brown and Herman Cappelen (eds.), Assertion: New Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Goldberg, Sanford C. 2015. Assertion: The Philosophical Significance of a Speech Act. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gerken, Mikkel. 2011. “Warrant and Action.” Synthese 178: 529-547.
  • Gerken, Mikkel. 2012. “Discursive Justification and Skepticism.” Synthese 189: 373-394.
  • Gerken, Mikkel. 2013. “Same, Same but Different: The Epistemic Norms of Assertion, Action, and Practical Reasoning.” Philosophical Studies 168: 725-744.
  • Grice, Paul. 1989. Studies in the Way of Words. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Hawthorne, John. 2004. Knowledge and Lotteries. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • ­­Hawthorne, John and Jason Stanley. 2008. “Knowledge and Action.” Journal of Philosophy 105: 571-590.
  • Hawthorne, John and Amia Srinivasan. 2013. “Disagreement Without Transparency: Some Bleak Thoughts.” In David Christensen and Jennifer Lackey (eds.), The Epistemology of Disagreement: New Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2007. “Moore’s Paradox and the Norm of Belief.” In Susana Nuccetelli and Gary Seay (eds.), Themes from G.E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hyman, John. 1999. “How Knowledge Works.” Philosophical Quarterly 49: 433-451.
  • Jackson, Alexander. 2012. “Two Ways to Put Knowledge First.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 90: 353-369.
  • Kvanvig, Jonathan L. 2009. “Assertions, Knowledge, and Lotteries.” In Patrick Greenough and Duncan Pritchard (eds.), Williamson on Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kvanvig, Jonathan L. 2011a. “Norms of Assertion.” In Jessica Brown and Herman Cappelen (eds.), Assertion: New Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kvanvig, Jonathan L. 2011b. “Against Pragmatic Encroachment.” Logos & Episteme 2: 77-85.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2007. “Norms of Assertion.” Noûs 41: 594-626.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2011. “Assertion and Isolated Second-Hand Knowledge.” In Jessica Brown and Herman Cappelen (eds.), Assertion: New Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2013. “Deficient Testimonial Knowledge.” In Tim Henning and David P. Schweikard (eds.), Knowledge, Virtue, and Action: Putting Epistemic Virtues to Work. New York: Routledge.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2014. “Assertion and Expertise.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.
  • Littlejohn, Clayton. 2012.  Justification and the Truth-Connection.  Cambridge University Press.
  • Littlejohn, Clayton. 2013. “The Russellian Retreat.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 113: 293-320.
  • Littlejohn, Clayton. 2014. “The Unity of Reason.” In Clayton Littlejohn and John Turri (eds.), Epistemic Norms: Assertion, Action, and Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • MacFarlane, John. 2011. “What is Assertion?” In In Jessica Brown and Herman Cappelen (eds.), Assertion: New Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Maitra, Ishani. 2011. “Assertion, Norms, and Games.” In Jessica Brown and Herman Cappelen (eds.), Assertion: New Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Maitra, Ishani and Brian Weatherson. 2010. “Assertion, Knowledge, and Action.” Philosophical Studies 149: 99-118.
  • McGlynn, Aidan. 2013. “Believing Things Unknown.” Noûs 47: 385-407.
  • McGlynn, Aidan. 2014. Knowledge First?  Basingstoke: Palgrave-Macmillan.
  • McKinnon, Rachel. 2013. “The Supportive Reasons Norm of Assertion.” American Philosophical Quarterly 50: 121-135.
  • McKinnon, Rachel and John Turri. 2013. “Irksome Assertions.” Philosophical Studies 166: 123-128.
  • Montgomery, Brian. 2014. “In Defense of Assertion.” Philosophical Studies. [published online Early View]
  • Montminy, Martin. 2013. “Why Assertion and Practical Reasoning Must Be Governed by the Same Epistemic Norm.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 94: 57-68.
  • Moore, G.E. 1942. “A Reply to My Critics.” In Paul Arthur Schilpp (ed.), The Philosophy of G.E. Moore, The Library of Living Philosophers. La Salle: Open Court Press. 3rd edn.: 1968.
  • Moore, G.E. 1962. Commonplace Book: 1919–1953. London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • Moore, G.E. 1993. “Moore’s Paradox.” In Thomas Baldwin (ed.), G.E. Moore: Selected Writings, 207–212. London: Routledge.
  • Moss, Sarah. 2013. “Epistemology Formalized.” Philosophical Review 122: 1-43.
  • Neta, Ram. 2009. “Treating Something as a Reason For Action.” Noûs 43: 684-699.
  • Pelling, Charlie. 2011. “A Self-Referential Paradox for the Truth Account of Assertion.” Analysis 71: 688.
  • Pelling, Charlie. 2013a. “Paradox and the Knowledge Account of Assertion.” Erkenntnis 78: 977-978.
  • Pelling, Charlie. 2013b. “Assertion and the Provision of Knowledge.” Philosophical Quarterly 63: 293-312.
  • Rescorla, Michael. 2009. “Assertion and its Constitutive Norms.” Philosophy & Phenomenological Research 79: 98-130.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan. 2008. “Knowledge in the Image of Assertion.” Philosophical Issues 18: 1-19.
  • Schroeder, Mark. 2008. “Having Reasons.” Philosophical Studies 139: 57-71.
  • Slote, Michael. 1979. “Assertion and Belief.” In Jonathan Dancy (ed.), Papers on Language and Logic. Keele University Library, pp. 177-90. Repr. in Slote, Selected Essays. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
  • Sorensen, Roy. 1988. Blindspots. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2007. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, volume 1. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • ­­­Sosa, Ernest. 2010. “Value Matters in Epistemology.” Journal of Philosophy 107: 167-190.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2011. Knowing Full Well. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2014. “Epistemic Agency and Judgment.” In Clayton Littlejohn and John Turri (eds.), Epistemic Norms: Assertion, Action, and Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stanley, Jason. 2005. Knowledge and Practical Interests. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stanley, Jason. 2008. “Knowledge and Certainty.” Philosophical Issues 18: 35-57.
  • Stone, Jim. 2007. “Contextualism and Warranted Assertion.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 88: 92-113.
  • Sutton, Jonathan. 2005. “Stick to What You Know.” Noûs 39: 359-396.
  • Sutton, Jonathan. 2007. Without Justification. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Turri, John. 2010. “Prompting Challenges.” Analysis 70: 456-462.
  • Turri, John. 2011. “The Express Knowledge Account of Assertion.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 89: 37-45.
  • Turri, John. 2013a. “Knowledge Guaranteed.” Noûs 47: 602-612.
  • Turri, John. 2013b. “The Test of Truth: An Experimental Investigation of the Norm of Assertion.” Cognition 129: 279-291.
  • Turri, John. 2014a. “Knowledge and Suberogatory Assertion.” Philosophical Studies 167: 557-567.
  • Turri, John. 2014b. “You Gotta Believe.” In Clayton Littlejohn and John Turri (eds.), Epistemic Norms: Assertion, Action, and Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Turri, John and Peter Blouw. 2014. “Excuse Validation: A Study in Rule-Breaking.” Philosophical Studies.
  • Unger, Peter. 1975. Ignorance: The Case for Skepticism. Oxford: Clarendon Press. Reissued 2002.
  • Weatherson, Brian. 2012. “Knowledge, Bets, and Interests.” In Jessica Brown and Mikkel Gerken (eds.), Knowledge Ascriptions. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Weiner, Matthew. 2005. “Must We Know What We Say?” Philosophical Review 114: 227-251.
  • Weisberg, Jonathan. 2013. “Knowledge in Action.” Philosophers’ Imprint 13: 1-23.
  • Whiting, Daniel. 2013. “Stick to the Facts: On the Norms of Assertion.” Erkenntnis 78: 847-867.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 1996. “Knowing and Asserting.” Philosophical Review 105: 489-523.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2008. “Why Epistemology Cannot be Operationalized.” In Quentin Smith (ed.), Epistemology: New Philosophical Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2009. “Replies to Critics.” In Patrick Greenough and Duncan Pritchard (eds.). Williamson on Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wright, Sarah. 2014. “The Dual-Aspect Norms of Belief and Assertion: A Virtue Approach to Epistemic Norms.” In Clayton Littlejohn and John Turri (eds.), Epistemic Norms: Assertion, Action, and Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

 

Author Information

Matthew A. Benton
Email: matthew.benton@philosophy.ox.ac.uk
University of Oxford
United Kingdom

The Problem of the Criterion

The Problem of the Criterion is considered by many to be a fundamental problem of epistemology.  In fact, Chisholm (1973, 1) claims that the Problem of the Criterion is “one of the most important and one of the most difficult of all the problems of philosophy.” A popular form of the Problem of the Criterion can be raised by asking two seemingly innocent questions: What do we know? How are we to decide in any particular case whether we have knowledge?  One quickly realizes how troubling the Problem of the Criterion is because it seems that before we can answer the first question we must already have an answer to the second question, but it also seems that before we can answer the second question we must already have an answer to the first question.  That is, it seems that before we can determine what we know we must first have a method or criterion for distinguishing cases of knowledge from cases that are not knowledge.  Yet, it seems that before we can determine the appropriate criterion of knowledge we must first know which particular instances are in fact knowledge.  So, we seem to be stuck going around a circle without any way of getting our epistemological theorizing started.  Although there are various ways of responding to the Problem of the Criterion, the problem is difficult precisely because it seems that each response comes at a cost.  This article examines the nature of the Problem and the costs associated with the most promising responses to the Problem.

Table of Contents

  1. The Problem
  2. Chisholm on the Problem of the Criterion
  3. Other Responses to the Problem of the Criterion
    1. Explanationist Responses
      1. Explanatory Particularism
      2. Coherentism
      3. Applied Evidentialism
    2. Dissolution
  4. The Problem of the Criterion’s Relation to Other Philosophical Problems
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Problem

The Problem of the Criterion is the ancient problem of the “wheel” or the “diallelus”.  It comes to us from Book 2 of Sextus Empiricus’ Outlines of Pyrrhonism.  Sextus presents the Problem of the Criterion as a major issue in the debate between the Academic Skeptics and the Stoics.  After Sextus’ presentation though, philosophers largely seemed to lose interest in the Problem of the Criterion until the modern period.  The problem resurfaced in the late 1500’s with Michael De Montaigne’s “Apology for Raymond Sebond” and it again had a significant influence.  Following the modern period, however, the Problem of the Criterion largely disappeared until the early 19th century when G.W.F. Hegel (1807) presented the problem and, arguably, put forward one of the first coherentist responses to the Problem of the Criterion (Rockmore (2006) and Aikin (2010)). In the late 19th and early 20th centuries Cardinal D.J. Mercier (1884) and his student P. Coffey (1917) again reminded the world of the problem.  In the late 20th century the Problem of the Criterion played an important role in the work of two philosophers: Roderick Chisholm and Nicholas Rescher.  In fact, it is primarily due to the work of Roderick Chisholm that the Problem of the Criterion is discussed by contemporary epistemologists at all. (See Amico (1993) and Popkin (2003) for further discussion of the historical development of the Problem of the Criterion).

In light of Chisholm’s enormous influence on contemporary discussions of the Problem of the Criterion his presentation of the problem is a fitting place to begin getting clear on things. Chisholm (1973, 12) often introduces the Problem of the Criterion with the following pairs of questions:

(A)  What do we know? What is the extent of our knowledge?

(B) How are we to decide whether we know? What are the criteria of knowledge?

However, Chisholm also speaks approvingly of Montaigne’s presentation of the Problem of the Criterion, which is in terms of true/false appearances rather than knowledge.  Further, there is some ambiguity in Chisholm’s own discussions of the Problem of the Criterion as to whether the problem presented by the Problem of the Criterion is the meta-epistemological problem of determining when we have knowledge or the epistemological problem of determining what is true.  So, there is a difficulty in determining exactly what problem the Problem of the Criterion is supposed to pose.

The fact that Chisholm’s discussion oscillates between these two versions of the Problem of the Criterion and the fact that he seems to be aware of the two versions of the problem help make it clear that perhaps there is no such thing as the Problem of the Criterion. Perhaps the Problem of the Criterion is rather a set of related problems.  This is something that many philosophers since Chisholm, and Chisholm himself (see his 1977), have noted.  For instance, Robert Amico (1993) argues that Chisholm mistakenly takes himself to be discussing the same problem as Sextus Empiricus when he considers the Problem of the Criterion.  Richard Fumerton (2008) points out that there are at least two versions of the Problem of the Criterion.  The first is a methodological problem of trying to identify sources of knowledge or justified belief (this, he claims, is the version of the problem that Chisholm focuses on).  The second is the problem of trying to identify the necessary and sufficient conditions for correctly applying concepts such as ‘knowledge’ or ‘justification’.  Michael DePaul (1988, 70) expresses a version of the Problem of the Criterion limited to moral discourse in terms of two questions: “Which of our actions are morally right?” and “What are the criteria of right action?”

Since there are many versions of the Problem of the Criterion, one might worry that it will be nearly impossible to formulate the Problem of the Criterion precisely.  Fortunately, this is not the case.  Although there are many particular instances of the Problem of the Criterion, they all seem to be questions of epistemic priority.  In other words, the various versions of the Problem of the Criterion are focused on trying to answer the question “how is it possible to theorize in epistemology without taking anything epistemic for granted?” (Conee 2004, 17).  More generally: how is it possible to theorize at all without making arbitrary assumptions? Hence, perhaps the best way to formulate the Problem of the Criterion in its most general form is with the following pair of questions (Cling (1994) and McCain and Rowley (2014)):

(1) Which propositions are true?

(2) How can we tell which propositions are true?

Plausibly, all the various formulations of particular versions of the Problem of the Criterion can be understood as instances of the problem one faces when trying to answer these general questions.

Before moving on it is important to be clear about the nature of (1) and (2).  These are not questions about the nature of truth itself.  Rather, these are epistemological questions concerning which propositions we should think are true and what the correct criteria are for determining whether a proposition should be accepted as true or false.  It is possible that one could have answers to these questions without possessing any particular theory of truth, or even taking a stand at all as to the correct theory of truth.  Additionally, it is possible to have a well-developed theory of the nature of truth without having an answer to either (1) or (2).  So, the issue at the heart of the Problem of the Criterion is how to start our epistemological theorizing in the correct way, not how to discover a theory of the nature of truth.

Most would admit that it is important to start our epistemological theorizing in an appropriate way by not taking anything epistemic for granted, if possible.  However, this desire to start theorizing in the right way coupled with the questions of the Problem of the Criterion does not yield a problem—it is merely a desire we have and questions we need to answer.  The problem yielded by the Problem of the Criterion arises because one might plausibly think that we cannot answer (1) until we have an answer to (2), but we cannot answer (2) until we have an answer to (1).  So, at least initially, consideration of the Problem of the Criterion makes it seem that we cannot get our theorizing started at all.  This seems to land us in a pretty extreme form of skepticism—we cannot even begin the project of trying to determine which propositions to accept as true.

Of course, there are anti-skeptical ways to respond to the Problem of the Criterion.  According to Chisholm, these anti-skeptical responses are question-begging.  In light of this one might think that extreme skepticism is inevitable.  However, this might not be correct.  The extreme skepticism threatened by the Problem of the Criterion itself seems guilty of begging the question.  This is why Chisholm (1973, 37) claims “we can deal with the problem only by begging the question.”

2. Chisholm on the Problem of the Criterion

According to Chisholm, there are only three responses to the Problem of the Criterion: particularism, methodism, and skepticism.  The particularist assumes an answer to (1) and then uses that to answer (2), whereas the methodist assumes an answer to (2) and then uses that to answer (1).  The skeptic claims that you cannot answer (1) without first having an answer to (2) and you cannot answer (2) without first having an answer to (1), and so you cannot answer either. Chisholm claims that, unfortunately, regardless of which of these responses to the Problem of the Criterion we adopt we are forced to beg the question.  It will be worth examining each of the responses to the Problem of the Criterion that Chisholm considers and how each begs the question against the others.

The particularist assumes an answer to (1) that does not epistemically depend on an answer to (2) and uses her answer to (1) to answer (2). More precisely, the particularist response to the Problem of the Criterion is:

Particularism             Assume an answer to (1) (accept some set of propositions as true) that does not depend on an answer to (2) and use the answer to (1) to answer (2).

What is the epistemic status of the particularist’s answer to (1)? Chisholm (1973, 37) seems to take it that its status is weak, being nothing more than an assumption:

But in all of this I have presupposed the approach I have called “particularism.” The “methodist” and the “skeptic” will tell us that we have started in the wrong place. If now we try to reason with them, then, I am afraid, we will be back on the wheel.

One might think that the question-begging only occurs if the particularist tries to reason with her methodist or skeptical interlocutors.  So, one might think the problem for particularism is simply a lack of reasons in support of particularism that advocates of methodism or skepticism would accept.

However, things are worse than this. The real problem with particularism is not simply the dialectical problem of providing grounds that methodists and skeptics will accept; rather it is an epistemic problem. The problem with particularism is that the particularist’s starting point is an unfounded assumption.  Particularism starts with a set of particular propositions and works from there.  If the particularist goes beyond that set of particular propositions to provide reasons for accepting them, she abandons that particularist response and either picks a new set of particular propositions to assume (a new particularist response) or picks something other than simply a new set of only particular propositions to assume and ceases to be a particularist.  So, the problem for the particularist response is much deeper than a dialectical problem that arises only when trying to deal with opposing views.  The particularist cannot offer reasons for particularism beyond the unfounded assumption of a set of particular propositions. By simply assuming an answer to (1), the particularist begs the question against both the methodists and the skeptics.

Particularism is not unique in begging the question though.  It seems that methodism begs the question too.  The methodist response to the Problem of the Criterion is:

Methodism                 Assume an answer to (2) (accept some criterion to be a correct criterion of truth – one that successfully discriminates true propositions from false ones) that does not depend on an answer to (1) and use the answer to (2) to answer (1).

Since methodism begins by assuming that some criterion is a correct criterion of truth without providing any epistemic reason to prefer this response to the alternatives, it begs the question against particularism and skepticism.

The skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion assumes that both particularism and methodism are mistaken.   That is, the skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion assumes that there is no answer to (1) that does not depend on an answer to (2) and there is no answer to (2) that does not depend on an answer to (1). As Chisholm (1973, 14) explains the response:

And so we can formulate the position of the skeptic on these matters. He will say: ‘You cannot answer question 1 until you answer question 2. And you cannot answer question 2 until you answer question 1. Therefore, you cannot answer either question. You cannot know what, if anything, you know, and there is no possible way for you to decide in any particular case.’

(The names of the questions have been changed from Chisholm’s “A” and “B” to “1” and “2”, respectively, in this quote in order to maintain continuity with the present discussion)

A bit more succinctly:

Skepticism                  Assume that (i) there is no independent answer to (1) or (2), and (ii) if (1) and (2) cannot be answered independently, they cannot be answered at all.

According to Chisholm, the skeptical response has no more to recommend it that particularism or methodism.  The reason for this is that skepticism, as a response to the Problem of the Criterion, is question-begging.  The skeptic simply assumes that there is no independent answer to (1) or (2) and though both the particularist and the methodist deny this assumption, they can only respond by appealing to assumptions of their own.  The skeptic has no reasons to support the assumption that there is no independent answer to (1) or (2).  The conflict between the three responses that Chisholm considers comes down to ungrounded assumptions. It is because of this fact that Chisholm claims when facing the Problem of the Criterion we have no choice but to beg the question. Since all responses beg the question, skepticism is no better off than any other response to the Problem of the Criterion.

At this point it is worth getting clear on two further points about the skeptical response.  First, it should be noted that the skeptical response is not the only response that might lead to a thoroughgoing skepticism.  For instance, one might be a methodist who assumes the criterion for distinguishing true from false propositions is absolute certainty.  That is, a methodist might think that the only way to tell whether a proposition is true is for the truth of the proposition to be absolutely certain for her.  Pretty clearly this sort of methodism will lead to a fairly extreme skepticism.  One of the lessons of Cartesian skepticism is that it is implausible to think that we can be absolutely certain about the truth of any proposition about the external world.

Second, one might think that the skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion really is better off than particularism or methodism. One might think that the skeptical response simply emerges from consideration of the problems facing both particularism and methodism, and so does not have to make any assumptions of its own.

Although the skeptical response may arise in this way, it does not absolve skepticism of begging the question. As Chisholm notes, the skeptical response has nothing in itself that makes it better than particularism or methodism. The skeptical resolution of the Problem of the Criterion has nothing to appeal to other than unfounded assumptions in order to motivate it over its alternatives.  Without something more than unfounded assumptions there does not seem to be any reason to prefer the skeptic’s response. Given this, accepting the skeptical response would still beg the question because there is no more reason to accept it than there is to accept any of the other positions.  Since the skeptical response has nothing more to recommend it in itself than the other responses, there is no more reason to accept the skeptical response because of the problems for particularism and methodism than there is to accept particularism because of the problems with the other responses, or to accept methodism for the same reason.  All three options seem to be on equal footing when it comes to having reason to pick them over their rivals and they all beg the question.

Each of these responses to the Problem of the Criterion begins with an unfounded assumption, one that is unsupported by reasons, and so begs the question in an epistemic sense against the other two.  Despite this and his emphasis on the fact that all three responses are unappealing because of their question-begging, Chisholm famously argues in support of particularism.  His argument in support of particularism, which he sometimes refers to as “commonsensism”, involves criticizing the other two responses and giving some reasons for preferring particularism.

Concerning methodism, Chisholm offers two objections.  First, he objects that the criterion that methodism starts with will be “very broad and far-reaching and at the same time completely arbitrary” (1973, 17).  Essentially, he thinks that there can be no good reason for starting with a broad criterion.  Second, he objects that methodism (at least of the empiricist variety that he considers in detail) will lead to skepticism.  When we adopt the methodist’s broad criterion it will turn out that many of the things we commonsensically take ourselves to know do not count as knowledge.  Chisholm finds this unacceptable.

Chisholm’s case against the skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion seems also to come down to two things.  The first is quite plain.  If methodism is flawed because it will lead to skepticism concerning many areas where we take ourselves to have knowledge, it is no surprise that Chisholm finds the skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion to be unacceptable.  It too has this result.  In fact, the skeptical response is in a sense doubly skeptical.  It not only holds that we lack knowledge in areas that we typically take ourselves to have knowledge, it holds that we cannot even begin the process of determining what we do know.  The second problem Chisholm seems to have with skepticism is simply that it has no more to recommend it that either of the other views.  Admittedly, this does not seem to be much of a criticism, especially since he grants that all three responses make unfounded assumptions.

Unfortunately, Chisholm’s positive support for particularism is very sparse.  In fact in his Aquinas Lectures he only claims, “in favor of our approach [particularism] there is the fact that we do know many things, after all” (1973, 38).  But, of course, this seems to merely be a statement of the assumption made by particularism, not a defense of it. As a solution to the Problem of the Criterion, Chisholm’s particularism seems to be lacking.  In fact, Robert Amico (1988b) argues that Chisholm’s “solution” is clearly unacceptable because Chisholm does not give us good independent reasons to reject either methodism or skepticism, he does not provide good reasons to prefer particularism to the other responses, and, as Chisholm himself admits, particularism begs the question.

Given the very weak argument in support of his preferred view, one might wonder what Chisholm is really up to when he discusses the Problem of the Criterion.  Throughout the many works in which he discusses the Problem of the Criterion Chisholm consistently favors particularism, but he also makes it clear that all responses to the Problem of the Criterion are unappealing and his own view must, just like its rivals, beg the question.  In responses to Amico’s criticisms Chisholm claims that particularism is superior to methodism and skepticism because by being a particularist one can give a reasonable account of knowledge, but one cannot make progress in epistemology by taking a methodist or skeptical approach.

A few further points about Chisholm’s take on the Problem of the Criterion that are often overlooked are worth mentioning here.  First, he claims that we should remain open to the possibility of one day discovering a version of methodism that fares better than the empiricist version he criticizes.  Second, Chisholm is adamant that in supporting particularism he is not trying to solve the Problem of the Criterion because “the problem of the criterion has no solution” (1988, 234).  So, Chisholm thinks that particularism is simply the best of a set of bad options—the options are bad because they beg the question; particularism is best because it allows us to make progress in epistemology.

3. Other Responses to the Problem of the Criterion

Chisholm claimed that there are only three responses to the Problem of the Criterion and that there is no solution to this problem.   Many philosophers disagree with Chisholm on both points.  In fact, Andrew Cling (1994) argues that there are eight non-skeptical responses to the Problem of the Criterion.  Importantly, Cling does not consider two of the non-skeptical responses that we will consider below, so it seems that if Cling is correct concerning the eight non-skeptical approaches he mentions and the two additional approaches discussed below are distinct responses, there are at least eleven (ten non-skeptical and one skeptical) responses to the Problem of the Criterion.  While there are many possible responses to the Problem of the Criterion the focus here will be limited to those that have been defended in the literature.

a. Explanationist Responses

As noted above, there are a number of responses to the Problem of the Criterion beyond the three kinds that Chisholm considers.  The employment of explanatory reasoning offers promising alternatives to the responses Chisholm considers.  These explanationist responses share a commitment to explanatory reasoning—they all involve attempting to answer (1) and (2) in a way that yields the most satisfactory explanatory picture.  A helpful way of understanding explanationist responses is as employing the method of reflective equilibrium to respond to the Problem of the Criterion. Roughly, the method of reflective equilibrium involves starting with a set of data (beliefs, intuitions, etc.) and making revisions to that set—giving up some of the data, adding new data to the set, giving more/less weight to some of the data, and so on—so as to create the best explanatory picture overall.  Reaching this equilibrium state of maximized explanatory coherence of the remaining data is thought to make accepting whatever data remains, whether this includes any of one’s initial data or not, reasonable (see coherentism and John Rawls for more on reflective equilibrium).  Of course, there have been criticisms of the viability of reflective equilibrium as a method of reasoning; however, for current purposes these can be set aside because the ultimate concern here is simply the sort of responses that can be generated by employing reflective equilibrium.

There are a variety of ways that one might attempt to respond to the Problem of the Criterion by using the method of reflective equilibrium.  The variation in these responses is largely a result of what one includes in the set of data that will form the basis for one’s reflection.  It is worth considering some of the more promising varieties of this response that have been put forward in the literature.

i. Explanatory Particularism

Although the explanatory particularism defended by Paul Moser (1989) is a kind of particularism, its explanationist elements warrant discussing it as a separate variety of response.  Moser’s (1989, 261) explanatory particularism begins with one’s “considered, but revisable, judgments” concerning particular propositions.  This is importantly different from the sort of particularism that Chisholm describes because explanatory particularism allows that the beliefs about the truth of particular propositions are revisable whereas particularism as Chisholm describes it does not clearly allow for this.  It is because of this that Moser claims that explanatory particularism does not beg the question against skeptics by ruling out skepticism from the start.  Importantly, the kind of skepticism Moser is discussing here is not the skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion, but rather the sort of skepticism that grants that we can get started in epistemological theorizing while claiming that ultimately we will end up lacking knowledge in a wide range of cases. External world skepticism is an example of this sort of skepticism; it grants that we are aware of what is required for knowledge, but claims that we simply fail to have knowledge of the world around us.  Like Chisholm’s particularism, explanatory particularism uses this initial set of propositions (i.e. this answer to (1)) to develop epistemic principles or criteria for truth (i.e. to answer (2)).  The initial set of propositions and criteria are both continually revised until a state of maximal explanatory coherence is reached.

Moser claims that explanatory particularism avoids begging the question in the way that Chisholm’s particularism or methodism does.  The reason for this is that Moser claims that the beliefs that explanatory particularism starts with are revisable.  Despite this and Moser’s claim that explanatory particularism does not beg the question against the skeptic, it is not clear that it avoids begging the question against the skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion.  After all, explanatory particularism assumes an independent answer to (1)—revisable or not it is still an answer—and then uses that to answer (2).  So, it at least seems that explanatory particularism begs the question against the skeptical response by denying the skeptic’s assumption that there is no independent answer to (1) or (2).

Ernest Sosa (2009) also defends a view that we might call explanatory particularism.  On Sosa’s view we begin with particular items of knowledge.  That is, we start with particular propositions that we know to be true.  According to Sosa, we know these propositions because our beliefs with respect to these propositions satisfy a correct general criterion of knowledge (they are formed by sufficiently reliable cognitive faculties).  Although we have knowledge of these propositions, we merely have what he terms “animal knowledge”.  Our knowledge of these propositions when we begin is only animal knowledge because we lack a higher-order perspective on these beliefs.  That is to say, we lack “reflective knowledge” of the fact that these first-order beliefs satisfy the proper criterion of knowledge.  However, on Sosa’s view we use our animal knowledge to develop a perspective on our epistemic situation that offers us an explanatory picture about how or why our first-order beliefs really do constitute knowledge, i.e. we develop reflective knowledge as to how our particular pieces of animal knowledge satisfy the proper criterion for knowledge.  This explanatory perspective yields reflective knowledge and it strengthens our animal knowledge.  A significant component of this picture is that we use our starting animal knowledge to come to answer both (1) and (2) from a reflective standpoint.  So, we begin with an answer to (1) in terms of animal knowledge and we use that answer to develop a perspective that gives us an answer to (2) with respect to both animal and reflective knowledge and an answer to (1) in terms of reflective knowledge.  Sosa’s explanatory response to the Problem of the Criterion relies on a mixture of levels.

Although Sosa’s explanatory particularism with its multiple levels seems more complex that Moser’s, one might think that it begs the question in the same way that Moser’s response does.  Namely, Sosa’s response, like Moser’s, assumes an independent answer to (1). Sosa’s assumed answer is only in terms of animal knowledge, however, it is still an answer.  His response then requires using that answer to develop an explanatory perspective that provides an answer to (2).  Thus, one might think that Sosa’s response seems to beg the question against the skeptical response in the same way that Moser’s response seems to: by denying the skeptic’s assumption (i) that there is no independent answer to (1) or (2).

ii. Coherentism

Coherentism responds to the Problem of the Criterion by starting with both beliefs about which propositions are true and beliefs about the correct method or methods for telling which beliefs are true.  It then uses these beliefs to attempt to answer both (1) and (2) at the same time (DePaul 1988 & 2009, Cling 1994, and Poston 2011). As Andrew Cling (1994, 274) explains:

To be a coherentist is to reject the epistemic priority of beliefs and criteria of truth. Instead, coherentists recommend balancing beliefs against criteria and criteria against beliefs until they all form a consistent, mutually supporting system.

The coherentist does not simply assume that the criterion of truth is to balance “beliefs against criteria and criteria against beliefs.”  To understand coherentism in this way would simply make it a variety of methodism, and so fail to appreciate the importance of its employment of reflective equilibrium.  Instead, the coherentist response involves starting with both beliefs about criteria of truth and also beliefs that particular propositions are true and then makes adjustments to beliefs of either kind in an attempt to reach a state of reflective equilibrium.  Once this equilibrium state has been reached the coherentist uses it to complete her answers to (1) and (2).

On one understanding of coherentism (Cling’s 1994 and Poston’s 2011) the coherentist accepts one of the skeptic’s assumptions, but denies the other.  In particular, this version of coherentism shares the skeptic’s assumption of (i) (there is no independent answer to (1) or (2)), but denies (ii) (if (1) and (2) cannot be answered independently, they cannot be answered at all).  More precisely, on this way of understanding coherentism it involves accepting (i) of Skepticism and adding to it the further assumptions that: (a) a particular criterion is correct (namely, explanatory goodness), (b) a set of particular propositions are true, and (c) the criterion and the set of propositions are not independent of each other.  However, it seems that if one begins with beliefs about which propositions are true and beliefs about the correct criteria for telling which beliefs are true along with the assumption that there is no independent answer to (1) or (2), this version of coherentism will beg the question for reasons similar to why Skepticism begs the question.  That is to say, the coherentist’s assumption of (i) begs the question against particularism and methodism.  After all, (i) is a groundless assumption with which the coherentist starts.  It may be awareness of this feature that helped lead Cling (2009) to ultimately abandon his coherentist response in favor of a skeptical stance with respect to the Problem of the Criterion.

Another way of understanding this approach is as Michael DePaul (1988 & 2009) depicts it.  According to this way of understanding coherentism, the coherentist starts with beliefs about which particular propositions are true and about the correct criteria for telling which beliefs are true, but she does not assume (i). This version of coherentism seems to avoid begging the question against both particularists and methodists because it does not assume that we can answer (1) prior to (2) or that we can answer (2) prior to (1) nor does it assume that they cannot be answered independently.  Instead, this kind of coherentism merely applies reflective equilibrium to the coherentist’s starting set of beliefs without taking a stand on (i) at all.  Now it might turn out that after the application of reflective equilibrium the coherentist is committed to a particular position with respect to (i), but this kind of coherentism does not have to take a stand on (i) from the start.  So, in some respects this way of understanding coherentism may seem superior to the previous version of coherentism.  However, its use of beliefs in the relevant data set seems to beg the question against the skeptic because starting with beliefs about which propositions are true assumes that we can answer and in fact already have an answer to (1).  Likewise, a belief about which criteria are successful for telling which beliefs are true assumes that we can answer and have an answer to (2).   In other words, this version of coherentism seems to beg the question against skepticism by assuming that (ii) is false.  Thus, applying reflective equilibrium to a set of beliefs appears to beg the question by assuming that one of the assumptions of skepticism is false from the outset.  This may be why DePaul (2009) accepts Chisholm’s position that all responses to the Problem of the Criterion end up begging the question.

A final coherentist response is Nicholas Rescher’s “systems-theoretic approach”.  Rescher’s development of this approach takes place over several books (1973a, 1973b, 1977, and 1980).  Although Rescher’s systems-theoretic approach is complex, the relevant details for the present discussion of the Problem of the Criterion are relatively straightforward. Rescher’s response begins by appealing to pragmatic considerations.  It starts with a method and a goal, applies the method and checks to see whether the results satisfy the goal.  So, with respect to the Problem of the Criterion the idea is that our goal is to come to believe true propositions and we start with some criterion for distinguishing true propositions from false.  We apply our criterion and then see if it helps us achieve our goal.  Assuming that the criterion does help us achieve our goal, we have completed the first step in Rescher’s process.  The second step in this process involves showing that a pragmatically successful criterion/method is connected to the truth.  Here Rescher (1977, 107) claims that “only when all the pieces fit together” do we have justification for the criterion.  Further, he is clear that coherence is central to this process.  It is because of this that Robert Amico (1993) argues that Rescher’s view, though complex, is simply a coherentist version of methodism—Rescher ultimately assumes that coherence is the appropriate criterion of truth.  This is so despite the fact that the criterion/method that Rescher starts with may not be coherence because ultimately his way of establishing that any criterion that one starts with is actually a correct criterion is by appeal to coherence.  Since Rescher assumes this role for coherence from the outset, his approach seems to be a form of methodism.  Although Rescher’s approach is a kind of methodism with a significant explanatory element and one that may make more progress in epistemology than the sort that Chisholm criticizes, it seems to be vulnerable to the same charge of question-begging that Chisholm leveled at other forms of methodism—something Rescher may accept since he does not believe the Problem of the Criterion can be solved, but it is at best something that one can “meet and overcome” (1980, 13).

iii. Applied Evidentialism

A final explanationist response to the Problem of the Criterion is what Earl Conee (2004) calls “Applied Evidentialism” (McCain and Rowley (2014) call it the “Seeming Intuition Response”).  This explanationist response differs from the previous ways of using reflective equilibrium to respond to the Problem of the Criterion in that it does not start with a set of beliefs.  Rather, Applied Evidentialism begins with one’s evidence.  In particular, when Conee defends this view he suggests beginning with the set of intuitions or what seems true to us about various propositions.  That is to say, Applied Evidentialism begins with what seems true to us both with respect to propositions about particular items of fact and with respect to criteria for determining when propositions are true.  According to Applied Evidentialism, the way to respond to the Problem of the Criterion is to start with these intuitions and then make modifications—give up some intuitions, form different intuitions, rank some intuitions as more/less important than others, and so on— until a state of equilibrium has been reached.  Once such an equilibrium state has been reached the data from that state can be used to answer (1) and (2). 

Like the other ways of using reflective equilibrium to respond to the Problem of the Criterion, Applied Evidentialism does not seem to beg the question against particularism or methodism because it does not assume that there can be no independent answer to (1) or (2).  Additionally, Applied Evidentialism does not seem to beg the question against the skeptic because it refrains from assuming an answer to (1) or (2) at the outset.  Further, Applied Evidentialism does not assume from the start that the equilibrium state that we end up with will be anti-skeptical.  It is consistent with Applied Evidentialism that reflection on our initial intuitions will in the end lead us to the conclusion that we are unaware of which propositions are true or that we lack an appropriate criterion for discovering this information.  In other words, Applied Evidentialism does not assume that we will have an answer to (1) or (2) when we reach our end equilibrium state.  After all, it could be that our equilibrium state is one in which no method appears to be correct and our best position with respect to each proposition seems to be to suspend judgment concerning its truth.  So, Applied Evidentialism does not seem to beg any questions against the skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion or other kinds of skepticism, such as Cartesian skepticism.

One might worry that Applied Evidentialism is really a form of methodism, and hence, open to the same charge of question begging as other kinds of methodism.  After all, Applied Evidentialism suggests that using the method of reflective equilibrium on one’s intuitions can provide a response to the Problem of the Criterion.

Upon reflection, however, it seems that Applied Evidentialism is not a kind of methodism.  Plausibly, someone can employ a method without having any beliefs about, or even conscious awareness of, the method at all.  Kevin McCain and William Rowley (2014) argue that methods are analogous to rules in this sense.  They maintain that someone might behave in accordance with a rule without intending to obey the rule or even being aware that there is such a rule at all.  For example, one can act in accordance with a rule of not driving faster than 50mph by simply not driving over 50mph.  She does not need to know that this is a rule or even have an intention to follow rules concerning speed limits.  Ignorance of a rule does not mean that one fails to act in accordance with a rule.  Likewise, McCain and Rowley claim, one can employ the method of reflective equilibrium without accepting or even being aware of the method being used.  So, Applied Evidentialism does not seem to be a kind of methodism.

McCain and Rowley further argue that Applied Evidentialism does not beg the question by assuming that reflective equilibrium is the correct criterion or method at the outset.  They maintain that this is not to say that one cannot be aware that reflective equilibrium is a good method from the outset.  Rather, they claim that the important point is that Applied Evidentialism does not take the goodness of reflective equilibrium as a starting assumption—perhaps one has the intuition that reflective equilibrium is a good method to employ, perhaps not.  The key, they argue, is that unlike methodism Applied Evidentialism does not require one to have beliefs about, or even awareness of, reflective equilibrium to begin to respond to the Problem of the Criterion.  So, they argue Applied Evidentialism is not a form of methodism.  And thus, Applied Evidentialism does not beg the questions that methodism does.

Even if one accepts that Applied Evidentialism does not beg the question, it may have other problems.  It seems that in order to avoid begging the question Applied Evidentialism requires being able to employ reflective equilibrium in responding to the Problem of the Criterion without needing reasons to think that reflective equilibrium is a good method from the start.  This, however, seems to commit the supporter of Applied Evidentialism to accepting that certain kinds of circular reasoning can provide one with good reasons.  More precisely, if Applied Evidentialism is to avoid being a form of methodism, and the question begging that comes with methodism, then it seems that Applied Evidentialism requires that one can have good reasons to believe the results of employing reflective equilibrium without first having good reasons to accept reflective equilibrium as a good method.  But, this allows for epistemic circularity because it can be the case that the claim that reflective equilibrium is a good method is itself one of the results that is produced in the final equilibrium state.  The heart of this worry is that Applied Evidentialism allows someone to use reflective equilibrium to come to reasonably believe that reflective equilibrium is a good method for determining true propositions. This is a kind of rule-circularity that occurs when a rule or method is employed to establish that that very rule or method is acceptable. The status of rule-circularity is contentious.  Several authors argue that it is benign (for example, Braithwaite (1953), Conee (2004), Matheson (2012), Sosa (2009), and Van Cleve (1984)), but others argue that it is vicious circularity (e.g., Cling (2003) and Vogel (2008)).  Depending on whether this circularity is benign or vicious, Applied Evidentialism is a promising or problematic response to the Problem of the Criterion (for more on this issue see epistemic circularity).

b. Dissolution

Robert Amico (1988a, 1993, and 1996) offers a very different response to the Problem of the Criterion.  Rather than attempting to solve the Problem of the Criterion, Amico attempts to “dissolve” it.  According to Amico, a philosophical problem is a question that can only be answered theoretically—it cannot be answered by purely empirical investigation.  Further, a philosophical problem is such that there is rational doubt as to the correct answer to the question asked by the problem.  He explains rational doubt as simply being such that withholding belief in a particular answer is the justified doxastic attitude to take.  Since he explicates philosophical problems in terms of rational doubt and rational doubt is relative to a person, Amico maintains that problems are always relative to particular people.  A particular question poses a problem for someone when that question generates rational doubt for her. 

It is because of the role of rational doubt that Amico distinguishes between solutions to problems and dissolutions of problems.  A solution to a problem is a set of true statements that answer the question that generates the problem and removes the rational doubt concerning the answer to the question.  Dissolution occurs when the rational doubt is removed, not by an answer to the question, but rather by recognition that it is impossible to adequately answer the question.  For example, Amico claims that the problem of how to square a circle is dissolved as soon as one recognizes that it is impossible to make a circular square.  Once someone sees that it is impossible to make a circular square, the question “How do you square a circle?” does not generate any rational doubt for her.  Without rational doubt, Amico claims that the problem has been dissolved and there is no need to look for a solution.

Like all problems, Amico claims that the Problem of the Criterion is only a problem for a particular person when its question raises rational doubt for the person.  When we first consider the questions posed by the Problem of the Criterion Amico claims that we may have rational doubt about how to answer the questions in such a way that that answer can be justified to the skeptic.  So, we face a problem.  However, Amico argues that consideration of the failure of other responses—in particular their tendency to be question begging— and consideration of the nature of the problem itself allows one to recognize that it is in fact impossible to answer the questions of the Problem of the Criterion in a way that can be justified to the skeptic.  Once one recognizes that it is impossible to answer the skeptic’s questions Amico alleges that the rational doubt generated by the Problem of the Criterion is removed.  Thus, he claims that the Problem of the Criterion is at that point dissolved.  Since it has been dissolved, we should not be troubled by the Problem of the Criterion at all.

There are three major challenges to Amico’s purported dissolution of the Problem of the Criterion.  The first, as Sharon Ryan (1996) argues, is that it does not seem that the problem has been dissolved, but instead it seems that Amico has simply accepted that the skeptic is correct.  Amico responds by claiming that the skeptical position is not a solution to the problem because that position cannot be justified to the particularist or the methodist.  Since none of the three positions can justify their position to the others, he claims that the problem is dissolved.  It is not clear that this adequately responds to Ryan’s criticism because one might think that claiming that there is no acceptable answer to the questions of the Problem of the Criterion is exactly what the skeptic had in mind all along.

The second major challenge to Amico’s view comes from the various responses to the Problem of the Criterion.  Although he does discuss several responses, Amico does not argue that all of the responses mentioned above fail to provide answers that remove the rational doubt raised by the Problem of the Criterion.  Insofar as one thinks that some of these responses to the Problem of the Criterion provide a solution to the problem, one will rightly be skeptical of Amico’s proffered dissolution.

The third major challenge to Amico’s view arises because he seems to rest his dissolution on what can and cannot be said in response to a skeptic.  Andrew Cling argues that the Problem of the Criterion does not require skeptical interlocutors at all.  Rather, Cling maintains that the difficulty illuminated by the Problem of the Criterion is that anti-skeptics have commitments that seem plausible when considered individually, but they are jointly inconsistent.  The inconsistency among these commitments is present whether or not there are skeptics.  Thus, Cling contends that arguing that the Problem of the Criterion is constituted by questions that cannot be answered does not dissolve the problem; it brings the problem to light.

4. The Problem of the Criterion’s Relation to Other Philosophical Problems

The Problem of the Criterion is a significant philosophical issue in its own right—if Chisholm is correct, it is one of the most fundamental of all philosophical problems.  However, according to many philosophers, there are additional reasons to study this problem.  They claim that the Problem of the Criterion is closely related to several other perennial problems of philosophy.  It is worth briefly noting some of the philosophical problems thought to be closely related to the Problem of the Criterion. 

First, James Van Cleve (1979) and Ernest Sosa (2007) maintain that the Cartesian Circle is in fact just a special instance of the Problem of the Criterion (See Descartes for more on the Cartesian Circle).  Sosa also argues that the problem of easy knowledge is closely related to the Problem of the Criterion—something that Stewart Cohen (2002) and Andrew Cling note as well.  In places Sosa seems to go so far as to suggest that the problem of easy knowledge and the Problem of the Criterion are the same problem. (See epistemic circularity for more on the problem of easy knowledge).

Next, Ruth Weintraub (1995) argues that Hume’s attack on induction is simply a special case of the Problem of the Criterion.  She claims that Hume essentially applies the Problem of the Criterion to induction rather than applying the problem in a general fashion (For more on Humean inductive skepticism see confirmation and induction, epistemology, and Hume: causation).

According to Bryson Brown (2006), the challenge of responding to skepticism about the past is just a version of the Problem of the Criterion.  He claims that debunking Bertrand Russell’s five-minute old universe hypothesis, for example, involves providing a criterion for trusting memory.  This, he argues, requires satisfactorily responding to the Problem of the Criterion.

Andrew Cling (2009) and (2014) maintains that the Problem of the Criterion and the regress argument for skepticism are closely related.  In fact, he argues that they are both instances of a more general problem that he calls the “paradox of reasons”.  Cling argues that this paradox arises because it seems that it is possible to have reasons for a belief, it seems that reasons themselves must be supported by reasons, and it seems that if an endless sequence of reasons—either in the form of an infinite regress or a circle of reasons—is necessary for having reasons for a belief, then it is impossible to have reasons for a belief.  According to Cling, these three commitments are inconsistent.  The important point for the current purpose is that Cling maintains that the Problem of the Criterion and the regress argument for skepticism are both instances of the paradox of reasons (See infinitism in epistemology for more on regress arguments).

Finally, Howard Sankey (2010, 2011, and 2012) argues that the Problem of the Criterion provides one of the primary, if not the primary, argument in support of epistemic relativism.  Relativists take the Problem of the Criterion to show that it is not possible to provide a justification for choosing one criterion over another.  However, rather than opting for skepticism, which claims that no criterion is justified, relativists respond to the Problem of the Criterion by holding that all criteria are equally rational to adopt—one’s choice is determined simply by the context in which one finds oneself.  Sankey argues that a clear understanding of the Problem of the Criterion is key to responding to the threat of epistemic relativism (For more on epistemic relativism see relativism).

The Problem of the Criterion is a significant philosophical problem in its own right.  However, if these philosophers are correct in claiming that the Problem of the Criterion is related to all of these various philosophical problems in important ways, close study of this problem and its responses could yield insights that are very far-ranging.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Aikin, S.F. “The Problem of the Criterion and a Hegelian Model for Epistemic Infinitism.” History of Philosophy Quarterly 27 (2010): 379-88.
    • Puts forward the view that Hegel proposes what is arguably a coherentist response to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Amico, R. P. “Reply to Chisholm on the Problem of the Criterion.” Philosophical Papers 17 (1988a): 235-36.
    • Presents a very brief formulation of his dissolution of the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Amico, R. P. “Roderick Chisholm and the Problem of the Criterion.” Philosophical Papers 17 (1988b): 217-29.
    • Argues that Chisholm’s particularist response to the Problem of the Criterion is unsatisfactory.
  • Amico, R. P. The Problem of the Criterion. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 1993.
    • The only book-length treatment of the Problem of the Criterion. Includes a helpful discussion of the history of the Problem of the Criterion, critiques of major responses to the Problem of the Criterion, and the full formulation of Amico’s proposed dissolution.
  • Amico, R. P. “Skepticism and the Problem of the Criterion.” In K. G. Lucey (ed.), On Knowing and the Known. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 1996. 132-41.
    • Argues against the skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion in favor of his dissolution of the problem.
  • Braithwaite, R.B. Scientific Explanation. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1953.
    • Argues that the sort of rule-circularity present in inductive arguments in support of induction is not always vicious.
  • Brown, B. “Skepticism About the Past and the Problem of the Criterion.” Croatian Journal of Philosophy 6 (2006): 291-306.
    • Argues that skepticism about the past is in essence a limited form of the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Chisholm, R.M. Perceiving. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1957.
    • Chisholm’s earliest discussion of the Problem of the Criterion appears in this work.
  • Chisholm, R.M.  The Problem of the Criterion. Milwaukee, WI: Marquette University Press, 1973.
    • The Aquinas Lecture on the Problem of the Criterion by one of the most influential epistemologists of the twentieth century. Arguably, this is the most important contemporary work on the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Chisholm, R.M. Theory of Knowledge. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall, 2nd Edition, 1977; 3rd Edition, 1989.
    • Chisholm’s famous and widely used epistemology textbook; contains brief discussions of the Problem of the Criterion in both of its later editions.
  • Chisholm, R.M. The Foundations of Knowing. Minneapolis, MN: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
    • Contains a reprint of Chisholm’s 1973 Aquinas Lecture.
  • Chisholm, R.M. “Reply to Amico on the Problem of the Criterion.” Philosophical Papers 17 (1988): 231-34.
    • Responds to Amico’s criticisms of his particularist response to the Problem of the Criterion. Claims that the Problem of the Criterion cannot be solved.
  • Cling, A.D. “Posing the Problem of the Criterion.” Philosophical Studies 75 (1994): 261-92.
    • Argues that there are many more options for responding to the Problem of the Criterion than Chisholm considers.  Presents his coherentist response to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Cling, A.D. “Epistemic Levels and the Problem of the Criterion.” Philosophical Studies 88 (1997): 109-40.
    • Presents the Problem of the Criterion as an argument for skepticism.  Argues that both Chisholm and Van Cleve fail to solve the problem.
  • Cling, A.D. “Self-Supporting Arguments.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 66 (2003): 279-303.
    • Evaluates the strength of self-supporting arguments in deductive and inductive logic.  Argues that rule-circularity is a kind of vicious circularity.
  • Cling, A.D. “Reasons, Regresses, and Tragedy: The Epistemic Regress Problem and the Problem of the Criterion.” American Philosophical Quarterly 46 (2009): 333-46.
    • Argues that the Problem of the Criterion and the regress argument for skepticism are both species of a more general problem, the “paradox of reasons”
  • Cling, A.D. “The Epistemic Regress Problem, the Problem of the Criterion, and the Value of Reasons.” Metaphilosophy 45 (2014): 161-71.
    • Further develops the idea that the Problem of the Criterion and the regress argument for skepticism are both species of a more general problem, the “paradox of reasons”.  Also, includes a discussion of the kinds of reasons that this problem reveals we can and cannot have.
  • Coffey, P. Epistemology or Theory of Knowledge. London: Longmans, Green, 1917.
    • This work by D.J. Mercier’s pupil is largely responsible for ushering discussion of the Problem of the Criterion into the 20th century.
  • Cohen, S. “Basic Knowledge and the Problem of Easy Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 65 (2002): 309-29.
    • Presents the problem of easy knowledge and notes its relevance to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Conee, E. “First Things First.” In E. Conee and R. Feldman, Evidentialism. New York: Oxford University Press, 2004. 11-36.
    • Presents and defends “Applied Evidentialism” as a response to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • DePaul, M. “The Problem of the Criterion and Coherence Methods in Ethics.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 18 (1988): 67-86.
    • Presents a version of the Problem of the Criterion in terms of moral theories and describes his coherentist response to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • DePaul, M. “Pyrrhonian Moral Skepticism and the Problem of the Criterion.” Philosophical Issues 19 (2009), 38-56.
    • Claims, like Chisholm, that all responses to the Problem of the Criterion—including the skeptical response—beg the question.
  • DePaul, M. “Sosa, Certainty and the Problem of the Criterion.” Philosophical Papers 40 (2011), 287-304.
    • Suggests that Chisholm’s own particularist response to the Problem of the Criterion may have included some subtle methodism. Also, provides a discussion of Sosa’s recent work on the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Fumerton, R. “The Problem of the Criterion.” In J. Greco (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Skepticism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2008. 34-52.
    • Claims there are at least two distinct problems often called the “Problem of the Criterion”.  Also, discusses some responses to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Greco, J. “Epistemic Circularity: Vicious, Virtuous and Benign.” International Journal for the Study of Skepticism 1 (2011): 1-8.
    • Provides a nice summary of Sosa’s most recent work on the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Hegel, G.W.F. Phenomenology of Spirit. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1979.
    • Helped draw attention back to the Problem of the Criterion in the 19th century.  Presents the Problem of the Criterion as a crisis for Spirit, and (arguably) proposes a coherentist response to the problem.
  • Lemos, Noah. Commonsense: A Contemporary Defense. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
    • Defends Chisholm’s particularist response to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Matheson, J. “Epistemic Relativism.” In A. Cullison (ed.), Continuum Companion to Epistemology. New York: Continuum, 2012. 161-79.
    • Argues against epistemic relativism and offers considerations for thinking that at least some kinds of epistemic circularity are not vicious.
  • Mercier, D.J. Criteriologie 8th Edition. Paris: Felix Alcan, 1923.
    • Helped draw attention back to the Problem of the Criterion in the 19th century.  Also, Chisholm cites Mercier’s conditions for what a satisfying criterion would have to look like.
  • McCain, K. and Rowley, W. “Pick Your Poison: Beg the Question or Embrace Circularity.” International Journal for the Study of Skepticism (2014): 125-40.
    • Explains why the three responses to the Problem of the Criterion that Chisholm considers each beg the question.  Also, argues that it is possible to respond to the Problem of the Criterion without begging the question, but doing so requires a commitment to certain forms of circularity as epistemically acceptable.
  • Montaigne, M. de. “Apology for Raymond Sebond.” In J. Zeitlin (trans.), Essays of Michael De Montaigne, New York: Knopf, 1935.
    • The Problem of the Criterion appears to have resurfaced in the modern period with this work.
  • Moser, P.K. Knowledge and Evidence. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
    • Presents and defends his explanatory particularist response to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Popkin, R.H. The History of Sceptism: From Savonarola to Bayle (Revised and Expanded Edition). New York: Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • Discusses the historical development of skepticism. Of particular interest is the discussion of the influence that the Problem of the Criterion had on philosophy during the modern period.
  • Poston, T. “Explanationist Plasticity & The Problem of the Criterion.” Philosophical Papers 40 (2011): 395-419.
    • Defends a coherentist response to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Rescher, N. The Coherence Theory of Truth. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1973a.
    • Part of the series of books in which Rescher’s “systems-theoretic approach” to the Problem of the Criterion is developed.
  • Rescher, N. The Primacy of Practice. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1973b.
    • Part of the series of books in which Rescher’s “systems-theoretic approach” to the Problem of the Criterion is developed.
  • Rescher, N. Methodological Pragmatism. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1977.
    • Part of the series of books in which Rescher’s “systems-theoretic approach” to the Problem of the Criterion is developed.
  • Rescher, N. Scepticism. Totowa, N.J.: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, 1980.
    • Part of the series of books in which Rescher’s “systems-theoretic approach” to the Problem of the Criterion is developed.
  • Rockmore, T. “Hegel and Epistemological Constructivism.” Idealistic Studies 36 (2006): 183-90.
    • Argues that Hegel proposes a coherentist response to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Ryan, S. “Reply to Amico on Skepticism and the Problem of the Criterion.” In K. G. Lucey (ed.), On Knowing and the Known. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 1996. 142-48.
    • Argues that Amico’s dissolution of the Problem of the Criterion really amounts to accepting the skeptical response to the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Sankey, H. “Witchcraft, Relativism and the Problem of the Criterion.” Erkenntnis 72 (2010): 1-16.
    • Explores the relationship between epistemic relativism and the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Sankey, H. “Epistemic Relativism and the Problem of the Criterion.” Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science 42 (2011): 562-70.
    • Explores the relationship between epistemic relativism and the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Sankey, H. “Scepticism, Relativism, and the Argument from the Criterion.” Studies in the History and Philosophy of Science 43 (2012): 182-90.
    • Explores the relationship between epistemic relativism and the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Sextus Empiricus. The Skeptic Way: Sextus Empiricus’s Outlines of Pyrrhonism, (trans.) B. Mates. New York: Oxford University Press, 1996.
    • The original presentation of the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Sosa, E. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume I. New York: Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • Argues that the Cartesian Circle is a version of the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Sosa, E. Reflective Knowledge: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume II. New York: Oxford University Press, 2009.
    • Develops Sosa’s response to the Problem of the Criterion.  Argues that the problem of easy knowledge is a version of the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Van Cleve, J. “Foundationalism, Epistemic Principles, and the Cartesian Circle.” The Philosophical Review 88 (1979): 55-91.
    • Argues that the Cartesian Circle is simply a special case of the Problem of the Criterion.
  • Van Cleve, J. “Reliability, Justification, and the Problem of Induction.” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 9 (1984): 555-67.
    • Presents an inductive argument in support of induction and argues that the rule-circularity involved in such an argument is not vicious.
  • Van Cleve, J. “Sosa on Easy Knowledge and the Problem of the Criterion.” Philosophical Studies 153 (2011): 19-28.
    • Discusses Sosa’s response to the Problem of the Criterion and the related, according to Sosa, problem of easy knowledge.
  • Vogel, J. “Epistemic Bootstrapping.” Journal of Philosophy 105 (2008): 518-39.
    • Argues that many forms of epistemic circularity are viciously circular.
  • Weintraub, R. “What Was Hume’s Contribution to the Problem of Induction?” Philosophical Quarterly 45 (1995): 460-70.
    • Argues that the problem of induction is simply a special case of the Problem of the Criterion.

 

Author Information

Kevin McCain
Email: mccain@uab.edu
University of Alabama at Birmingham
U. S. A.

Phenomenal Conservatism

Phenomenal Conservatism is a theory in epistemology that seeks, roughly, to ground justified beliefs in the way things “appear” or “seem” to the subject who holds a belief. The theory fits with an internalistic form of foundationalism—that is, the view that some beliefs are justified non-inferentially (not on the basis of other beliefs), and that the justification or lack of justification for a belief depends entirely upon the believer’s internal mental states. The intuitive idea is that it makes sense to assume that things are the way they seem, unless and until one has reasons for doubting this.

This idea has been invoked to explain, in particular, the justification for perceptual beliefs and the justification for moral beliefs. Some believe that it can be used to account for all epistemic justification. It has been claimed that the denial of Phenomenal Conservatism (PC) leaves one in a self-defeating position, that PC naturally emerges from paradigmatic internalist intuitions, and that PC provides the only simple and natural solution to the threat of philosophical skepticism. Critics have objected that appearances should not be trusted in the absence of positive, independent evidence that appearances are reliable; that the theory allows absurd beliefs to be justified for some subjects; that the theory allows irrational or unreliable cognitive states to provide justification for beliefs; and that the theory has implausible implications regarding when and to what degree inferences produce justification for beliefs.

Table of Contents

  1. Understanding Phenomenal Conservatism
    1. Species of Appearance
    2. Defeasibility
    3. Kinds of Justification
    4. Comparison to Doxastic Conservatism
  2. The Nature of Appearance
    1. The Belief that P
    2. The Disposition to Believe that P
    3. The Belief that One Has Evidence for P
    4. The Experience View
    5. Appearance versus Acquaintance
  3. Arguments for Phenomenal Conservatism
    1. Intuitive Internalist Motivation
    2. An Internal Coherence Argument
    3. The Self-Defeat Argument
    4. Avoiding Skepticism
    5. Simplicity
  4. Objections
    1. Crazy Appearances
    2. Metajustification
    3. Cognitive Penetration and Tainted Sources
    4. Inferential Justification
  5. Summary
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Understanding Phenomenal Conservatism

a. Species of Appearance

The following is a recent formulation of the central thesis of phenomenal conservatism:

PC If it seems to S that P, then, in the absence of defeaters, S thereby has at least some justification for believing that P (Huemer 2007, p. 30; compare Huemer 2001, p. 99).

The phrase “it seems to S that P” is commonly understood in a broad sense that includes perceptual, intellectual, memory, and introspective appearances. For instance, as I look at the squirrel sitting outside the window now, it seems to me that there is a squirrel there; this is an example of a perceptual appearance (more specifically, a visual appearance). When I think about the proposition that no completely blue object is simultaneously red, it seems to me that this proposition is true; this is an intellectual appearance (more specifically, an intuition). When I think about my most recent meal, I seem to remember eating a tomatillo cake; this is a mnemonic (memory) appearance. And when I think about my current mental state, it seems to me that I am slightly thirsty; this is an introspective appearance.

b. Defeasibility

Appearances sometimes fail to correspond to reality, as in the case of illusions, hallucinations, false memories, and mistaken intuitions. Most philosophers agree that logically, this could happen across the board – that is, the world as a whole could be radically different from the way it appears. These observations do not conflict with phenomenal conservatism. Phenomenal conservatives do not hold that appearances are an infallible source of information, or even that they are guaranteed to be generally reliable. Phenomenal conservatives simply hold that to assume things are the way they appear is a rational default position, which one should maintain unless and until grounds for doubt (“defeaters”) appear. This is the reason for the phrase “in the absence of defeaters” in the above formulation of PC (section 1a).

These defeaters may take two forms. First, there might be rebutting defeaters, that is, evidence that what appears to be the case is in fact false. For instance, one might see a stick that appears bent when half-submerged in water. But one might then feel the stick, and find that it feels straight. The straight feel of the stick would provide a rebutting defeater for the proposition that the stick is bent.

Second, there might be undercutting defeaters, that is, evidence that one’s appearance (whether it be true or false) is unreliable or otherwise defective as a source of information. For instance, suppose one learns that an object that appears red is in fact illuminated by red lights. The red lighting is not by itself evidence that the object isn’t also red; however, the red lighting means that the look of the object is not a reliable indicator of its true color. Hence, the information about the unusual lighting conditions provides an undercutting defeater for the proposition that the object is red.

c. Kinds of Justification

Epistemologists commonly draw a (misleadingly named) distinction between “propositional justification” and “doxastic justification”, where propositional justification is justification that one has for believing something (whether or not one in fact believes it) and doxastic justification is justification that an actual belief possesses. The distinction is commonly motivated by pointing out that a person might have good reasons to believe a proposition and yet not believe it for any of those reasons, but instead believe it for some bad reason. For instance, I might be in possession of powerful scientific evidence supporting the theory of evolution, but yet my belief in the theory of evolution might actually be based entirely upon trust in the testimony of my tarot card reader. In that case, I would be said to have “propositional justification” but not “doxastic justification” for the theory of evolution.

It is commonly held that to have doxastic justification for P, an individual must satisfy two conditions: first, the individual must have propositional justification for P; second, the individual must base a belief that P on that propositional justification (or whatever confers that propositional justification). If we accept this view, then the phenomenal conservative should hold (i) that the appearance that P gives one propositional justification, in the absence of defeaters, for believing that P, and (ii) that if one believes that P on the basis of such an undefeated appearance, one thereby has doxastic justification for P.

Phenomenal conservatism was originally advanced as an account of foundational, or noninferential, justification (Huemer 2001, chapter 5). That is, it was advanced to explain how a person may be justified in believing that P without basing the belief that P on any other beliefs. Some hold that a variation of phenomenal conservatism may also be used to account for inferential justification – that is, that even when a person believes that P on the basis of other beliefs, the belief that P is justified in virtue of appearances (especially the “inferential appearance” that in the light of certain premises, P must be or is likely to be true) (Huemer 2013b, pp. 338-41); this last suggestion, however, remains controversial even among those sympathetic to PC.

d. Comparison to Doxastic Conservatism

A related but distinct view, sometimes called “epistemic conservatism” but better labeled “doxastic conservatism”, holds that a person’s merely believing that P gives that person some justification for P, provided that the person has no grounds for doubting that belief (Swinburne 2001, p. 141). (Etymological note: the term “doxastic” derives from the Greek word for belief [doxa], while “phenomenal” derives from the Greek word for appearance [phainomenon].)

Doxastic conservatism is an unpopular view, as it seems to endorse circular reasoning, or something very close to it. A thought experiment due to Richard Foley (1983) illustrates the counterintuitiveness of doxastic conservatism: suppose that S has some evidence for P which is almost but not quite sufficient to justify P. Suppose that S forms the belief that P anyway. If doxastic conservatism is correct, it seems, then as soon as S formed this belief, it would immediately become justified, since in addition to the evidence S already had for P, S would now have his belief that P serving as a source of justification, which would push S over the threshold for justified belief.

The phenomenal conservative aims to avoid this sort of implausibility. PC does not endorse circular reasoning, since it does not hold that a belief (or any other mental state) may justify itself; it holds that an appearance may justify a belief. Provided that no appearance is a belief, this view avoids the most obviously objectionable form of circularity, and it avoids the Foley counterexample. Suppose that S has almost enough justification to believe that P, and then, in addition, S acquires an appearance that P. Assume also that S has no defeaters for a belief in P. In this case, it is not counterintuitive to hold that S would then be justified in believing that P.

2. The Nature of Appearance

Phenomenal conservatism ascribes justificatory significance to appearances. But what are appearances? Philosophers have taken a number of different views about the nature of appearances, and which view one takes may dramatically affect the plausibility of PC. In this section, we consider some views philosophers have taken about what it is for it to “seem to one that P.”

a. The Belief that P

Here is a very simple theory: to say that it seems to one that P is to report a tentative sort of belief that P (Chisholm [1957, ch. 4] suggested something in this neighborhood). This, however, is not how “seems” is understood by phenomenal conservatives when they state that if it seems to one that P and one lacks defeaters for P, then one has justification for P.

To motivate the distinction between its seeming to one that P and one’s believing that P, notice that in some cases, it seems to one that P even though one does not believe that P. For instance, when one experiences perceptual illusions, the illusions typically persist even when one learns that they are illusions. That is to say, things continue to appear a certain way even when one does not believe that things are as they appear, indeed, even when one knows that things are not as they appear. This shows that an appearance that P is not a belief that P.

b. The Disposition to Believe that P

Some thinkers suggest that an appearance that P might be identified with a mere inclination or disposition to believe that P (Sosa 1998, pp. 258-9; Swinburne 2001, pp. 141-2; Armstrong 1961). Typically, when it appears to one that P, one will be disposed to believe that P. However, one may be disposed to believe that P when it doesn’t seem to one that P. For instance, if one is inclined to believe that P merely because one wants P to be true, or because one thinks that a virtuous person would believe that P, this would not be a case in which it seems to one that P. Even in cases where it seems to one that P, its seeming to one that P is not to be identified with the disposition to believe that P, since one is disposed to believe that P because it seems to one that P, and not the other way around. Thus, its seeming to one that P is merely one possible ground for the disposition to believe that P.

c. The Belief that One Has Evidence for P

Some philosophers hold that its seeming to one that P is a matter of one’s believing, or being disposed to believe, that some mental state one has is evidence for P (Conee 2013; Tooley 2013). This would undermine the plausibility of PC, since it is not very plausible to think that one’s merely being disposed to believe (whether rightly or wrongly) that one has evidence for P actually gives one justification for believing P.

Fortunately, phenomenal conservatives can reasonably reject that sort of analysis, on grounds similar to those used to reject the idea that its seeming to one that P is just a matter of one’s being disposed to believe that P. Suppose that Jon is disposed to believe that he has evidence for the reality of life after death merely because Jon wants it to be true that he has evidence for life after death (a case of pure wishful thinking). This surely would not count as its seeming to Jon that there is life after death.

d. The Experience View

Most phenomenal conservatives hold that its seeming to one that P is a matter of one’s having a certain sort of experience, which has propositional content but is not analyzable in terms of belief (for discussion, see Tucker 2013, section 1). Sensory experiences, intellectual intuitions, (apparent) memories, and introspective states are either species of this broad type of experience, or else states that contain an appearance as a component.

Some philosophers have questioned this view of appearance, on the ground that intellectual intuitions, perceptual experiences, memories, and episodes of self-awareness are extremely different mental states that have nothing interesting in common (DePaul 2009, pp. 208-9).

In response, one can observe that intuitions, perceptual experiences, memories, and states of self-awareness are all mental states of a kind that naturally incline one to believe something (namely, the content of that very mental state, or, the thing that appears to one to be the case). And it is not merely that one is inclined to believe that proposition for some reason or other. We can distinguish many different reasons why one might be inclined to believe P: because one wants P to be true, because one thinks a good person would believe P, because one wants to fit in with the other people who believe P, because being a P-believer will annoy one’s parents . . . or because P just seems to one to be the case. When we reflect on these various ways of being disposed to believe P, we can see that the last one is interestingly different from all the others and forms a distinct (non-disjunctive) category. Admittedly, I have not just identified a new characteristic or set of characteristics that all and only appearances have in common; I have not defined “appearance”, and I do not believe it is possible to do so. What I have done, I hope, is simply to draw attention to the commonality among all appearances by contrasting appearances with various other things that tend to produce beliefs. When Jon believes [for all numbers x and y, x+y = y+x] because that proposition is intuitively obvious, and Mary believes [the cat is on the couch] because she seems to see the cat on the couch, these two situations are similar to each other in an interesting respect – which we see when we contrast both of those cases with cases such as that in which Sally thinks her son was wrongly convicted because Sally just cannot bear the thought that her son is a criminal (Huemer 2009, pp. 228-9).

e. Appearance versus Acquaintance

Appearances should be distinguished from another sort of non-doxastic mental state sometimes held to provide foundational justification for beliefs, namely, the state of acquaintance (Russell 1997, chs. 5, 9; Fumerton 1995, pp. 73-9). Acquaintance is a form of direct awareness of something. States of acquaintance differ from appearances in that the occurrence of an episode of acquaintance entails the existence of an object with which the subject is acquainted, whereas an appearance can occur without there being any object that appears. For example, if a person has a fully realistic hallucination of a pink rat, we can say that the person experiences an appearance of a pink rat, but we cannot say the person is acquainted with a pink rat, since there is no pink rat with which to be acquainted. In other words, an appearance is an internal mental representation, whereas acquaintance is a relation to some object.

3. Arguments for Phenomenal Conservatism

a. Intuitive Internalist Motivation

Richard Foley (1993) has advanced a plausible account of rationality, on which, roughly, it is rational for S to do A provided that, from S’s own point of view, doing A would seem to be a reasonably effective way of satisfying S’s goals. Foley goes on to suggest that epistemic rationality is rationality from the standpoint of the goal of now believing truths and avoiding falsehoods. Though Foley does not draw this consequence, his account of epistemic rationality lends support to PC, for if it seems to S that P is true and S lacks grounds for doubting P, then from S’s own point of view, believing P would naturally seem to be an effective way of furthering S’s goal of believing truths and avoiding falsehoods. Therefore, it seems, it would be epistemically rational for S to believe that P (Huemer 2001, pp. 103-4; compare McGrath 2013, section 1).

b. An Internal Coherence Argument

Internalism in epistemology is, roughly, the view that the justification or lack of justification of a belief is entirely a function of the internal mental states of the believer (for a fuller account, see Fumerton 1995, pp. 60-9). Externalism, by contrast, holds that a belief’s status as justified or unjustified sometimes depends upon factors outside the subject’s mind.

The following is one sort of argument for internalism and against externalism. Suppose that externalism is true, and that the justification of a belief depends upon some external factor, E. There could be two propositions, P and Q, that appear to one exactly alike in all epistemically relevant respects—for instance, P and Q appear equally true, equally justified, and equally supported by reliable belief-forming processes; however, it might be that P is justified and Q unjustified, because P but not Q possesses E. Since E is an external factor, this need have no impact whatsoever on how anything appears to the subject. If such a situation occurred, the externalist would presumably say that one ought to believe that P, while at the same time either denying Q or withholding judgment concerning Q.

But if one took this combination of attitudes, it seems that one could have no coherent understanding of what one was doing. Upon reflecting on one’s own state of mind, one would have to hold something like this: “P and Q seem to me equally correct, equally justified, and in every other respect equally worthy of belief. Nevertheless, while I believe P, I refuse to believe Q, for no apparent reason.” But this seems to be an irrational set of attitudes to hold. Therefore, we ought to reject the initial externalist assumption, namely, that the justificatory status of P and Q depends on E.

If one accepts this sort of motivation for internalism, then it is plausible to draw a further conclusion. Not only does the justificatory status of a belief depend upon the subject’s internal mental states; it depends, more specifically, on the subject’s appearances (that is, on how things seem to the subject). On this view, it is impossible for P and Q to seem the same to one in all relevant respects and yet for P to be justified and Q unjustified. This is best explained by something like PC (Huemer 2006).

c. The Self-Defeat Argument

One controversial argument claims that PC is the only theory of epistemic justification that is not self-defeating (Huemer 2007; Skene 2013). The first premise of this argument is that all relevant beliefs (all beliefs that are plausible candidates for being doxastically justified) are based on appearances. I think there is a table in front of me because it appears that way. I think three plus three is six because that seems true to me. And so on. There are cases of beliefs not based on how things seem, but these are not plausible candidates for justified beliefs to begin with. For instance, I might believe that there is life after death, not because this seems true but because I want it to be true (wishful thinking) – but this would not be a plausible candidate for a justified belief.

The second premise is that a belief is doxastically justified only if what it is based on is a source of propositional justification. Intuitively, my belief is justified only if I not only have justification for it but also believe it because of that justification.

From here, one can infer that unless appearances are a source of propositional justification, no belief is justified, including the belief that appearances are not a source of propositional justification. Therefore, to deny that appearances are a source of propositional justification would be self-defeating. Huemer (2007) interprets this to mean that the mere fact that something appears to one to be the case must (in the absence of defeaters) suffice to confer justification. Some critics maintain, however, that one need only hold that some appearances generate justification, allowing that perhaps other appearances fail to generate justification even in the absence of defeaters (BonJour 2004, p. 359).

A related objection holds that there may be “background conditions” for a belief’s justification – conditions that enable an appearance to provide justification for a belief but which are not themselves part of the belief’s justification. Thus, PC might be false, not because appearances fail to constitute a source of justification, but because they only do so in the presence of these background conditions, which PC neglects to mention. And these background conditions need not themselves be causally related to one’s belief in order for one’s belief to be doxastically justified. (For this objection, see Markie 2013, section 2; for a reply, see Huemer 2013b, section 4.)

Other critics hold that the first premise of the self-defeat argument is mistaken, because it often happens that one justifiedly believes some conclusion on the basis of an inference from other (justified) beliefs, where the conclusion of the inference does not itself seem true; hence, one can be justified in believing P without basing that belief on a seeming that P (Conee 2013, pp. 64-5). In reply, the first premise of the self-defeat argument need not be read as holding that the belief that P (in relevant cases) is always based on an appearance that P. It might be held that the belief that P (in relevant cases) is always based either on the appearance that P or on some ultimate premises which are themselves believed because they seem correct.

d. Avoiding Skepticism

Skeptics in epistemology maintain that we don’t know nearly as much as we think we do. There are a variety of forms of skepticism. For instance, external world skeptics hold that no one knows any contingent propositions about the external world (the world outside one’s own mind). These skeptics argue that to know anything about the external world, one would need to be able to figure out what the external world is likely solely on the basis of facts about one’s own experiences, but that in fact nothing can be legitimately inferred about non-experiential reality solely from one’s own experiences (Hume 1975, section XII, part 1). Most epistemologists consider this conclusion to be implausible on its face, even absurd, so they have sought ways of rebutting the skeptic’s arguments. However, rebutting skeptical arguments has proved very difficult, and there is no generally accepted refutation of external world skepticism.

Another form of skepticism is moral skepticism, the view that no one knows any substantive evaluative propositions. On this view, no one ever knows that any action is wrong, that any event is good, that any person is vicious or virtuous. Again, this idea seems implausible on its face, but philosophers have found it difficult to explain how, in general, someone can know what is right, wrong, good, or bad. Skeptical views may also be held in a variety of other areas – skeptics may challenge our knowledge of the past, of other people’s minds, or of all things not presently observed. As a rule, epistemologists seek to avoid skeptical conclusions, yet it is often difficult to do so plausibly.

Enter phenomenal conservatism. Once one accepts something in the neighborhood of PC, most if not all skeptical worries are easily resolved. External world skepticism is addressed by noting that, when we have perceptual experiences, there seem to us to be external objects of various sorts around us. In the absence of defeaters, this is good reason to think there are in fact such objects (Huemer 2001). Moral skepticism is dealt with in a similarly straightforward manner. When we think about certain kinds of situations, our ethical intuitions show us what is right, wrong, good, or bad. For instance, when we think about pushing a man in front of a moving train, the action seems wrong. In the absence of defeaters, this is good enough reason to think that pushing the man in front of the train would be wrong (Huemer 2005). Similar observations apply to most if not all forms of skepticism. Thus, the ability to avoid skepticism, long considered an elusive desideratum of epistemological theories, is among the great theoretical advantages of phenomenal conservatism.

e. Simplicity

If we accept phenomenal conservatism, we have a single, simple principle to account for the justification of multiple very different kinds of belief, including perceptual beliefs, moral beliefs, mathematical beliefs, memory beliefs, beliefs about one’s own mind, beliefs about other minds, and so on. One may even be able to unify inferential and non-inferential justification (Huemer 2013b, pp. 338-41). To the extent that simplicity and unity are theoretical virtues, then, we have grounds for embracing PC. There is probably no other (plausible) theory that can account for so many justified beliefs in anything like such a simple manner.

4. Objections

a. Crazy Appearances

Some critics have worried that phenomenal conservatism commits us to saying that all sorts of crazy propositions could be non-inferentially justified. Suppose that when I see a certain walnut tree, it just seems to me that the tree was planted on April 24, 1914 (this example is from Markie 2005, p. 357). This seeming comes completely out of the blue, unrelated to anything else about my experience – there is no date-of-planting sign on the tree, for example; I am just suffering from a brain malfunction. If PC is true, then as long as I have no reason to doubt my experience, I have some justification for believing that the tree was planted on that date.

More ominously, suppose that it just seems to me that a certain religion is true, and that I should kill anyone who does not subscribe to the one true religion. I have no evidence either for or against these propositions other than that they just seem true to me (this example is from Tooley 2013, section 5.1.2). If PC is true, then I would be justified (to some degree) in thinking that I should kill everyone who fails to subscribe to the “true” religion. And perhaps I would then be morally justified in actually trying to kill these “infidels” (as Littlejohn [2011] worries).

Phenomenal conservatives are likely to bravely embrace the possibility of justified beliefs in “crazy” (to us) propositions, while adding a few comments to reduce the shock of doing so. To begin with, any actual person with anything like normal background knowledge and experience would in fact have defeaters for the beliefs mentioned in these examples (people can’t normally tell when a tree was planted by looking at it; there are many conflicting religions; religious beliefs tend to be determined by one’s upbringing; and so on).

We could try to imagine cases in which the subjects had no such background information. This, however, would render the scenarios even more strange than they already are. And this is a problem for two reasons. First, it is very difficult to vividly imagine these scenarios. Markie’s walnut tree scenario is particularly hard to imagine – what is it like to have an experience of a tree’s seeming to have been planted on April 24, 1914? Is it even possible for a human being to have such an experience? The difficulty of vividly imagining a scenario should undermine our confidence in any reported intuitions about that scenario.

The second problem is that our intuitions about strange scenarios may be influenced by what we reasonably believe about superficially similar but more realistic scenarios. We are particularly unlikely to have reliable intuitions about a scenario S when (i) we never encounter or think about S in normal life, (ii) S is superficially similar to another scenario, S', which we encounter or think about quite a bit, and (iii) the correct judgment about S' is different from the correct judgment about S. For instance, in the actual world, people who think they should kill infidels are highly irrational in general and extremely unjustified in that belief in particular. It is not hard to see how this would incline us to say that the characters in Tooley’s and Littlejohn’s examples are also irrational. That is, even if PC were true, it seems likely that a fair number of people would report the intuition that the hypothetical religious fanatics are unjustified.

A further observation relevant to the religious example is that the practical consequences of a belief may impact the degree of epistemic justification that one needs in order to be justified in acting on the belief, such that a belief with extremely serious practical consequences may call for a higher degree of justification and a stronger effort at investigation than would be the case for a belief with less serious consequences. PC only speaks of one’s having some justification for believing P; it does not entail that this is a sufficient degree of justification for taking action based on P.

b. Metajustification

Some argue that its merely seeming to one that P cannot suffice (even in the absence of defeaters) to confer justification for believing P; in addition, one must have some reason for thinking that one’s appearances are reliable indicators of the truth, or that things that appear to one to be the case are likely to actually be the case (BonJour 2004, pp. 357-60; Steup 2013). Otherwise, one would have to regard it as at best an accident that one managed to get to the truth regarding whether P. We can refer to this alleged requirement on justified belief as the “metajustification requirement”. (When one has an alleged justification for P, a “metajustification” is a justification for thinking that one’s alleged justification for P actually renders P likely to be true [BonJour 1985, p. 9].)

While perhaps superficially plausible, the metajustification requirement threatens us with skepticism. To begin with, if we think that appearance-based justifications require metajustifications (to wit, evidence that appearances are reliable indicators of the truth), it is unclear why we should not impose the same requirement on all justifications of any kind. That is, where someone claims that belief in P is justified because of some state of affairs X, we could always demand a justification for thinking that X – whatever it is – is a reliable indicator of the truth of P. And suppose X' explains why we are justified in thinking that X is a reliable indicator of the truth of P. Then we’ll need a reason for thinking that X' is a reliable indicator of X’s being a reliable indicator of the truth of P. And so on, ad infinitum.

One can avoid this sort of infinite regress by rejecting any general metajustification requirement. The phenomenal conservative will most likely want to maintain that one need not have positive grounds for thinking one’s appearances to be reliable; one is simply entitled to rely upon them unless and until one acquires grounds for doubting that they are reliable.

c. Cognitive Penetration and Tainted Sources

Another class of objection to PC adverts to cases of appearances that are produced by emotions, desires, irrational beliefs, or other kinds of sources that would normally render a belief unjustified (Markie 2006, pp. 119-20; Lyons 2011; Siegel 2013; McGrath 2013). That is, where a belief produced by a particular source X would be unjustified, the objector contends that an appearance produced by X should not be counted as conferring justification either (even if the subject does not know that the appearance has this source).

Suppose, for instance, that Jill, for no good reason, thinks that Jack is angry (this example is from Siegel 2013). This is an unjustified belief. If Jill infers further conclusions from the belief that Jack is angry, these conclusions will also be unjustified. But now suppose that Jill’s belief that Jack is angry causes Jill to see Jack’s facial expression as one of anger. This “seeing as” is not a belief but a kind of experience – that is, Jack’s face just looks to Jill like an angry face. This is, however, a misinterpretation on Jill’s part, and an ordinary observer, without any preexisting beliefs about Jack’s emotional state, would not see Jack as looking angry. But Jill is not aware that her perception has been influenced by her belief in this way, nor has she any other defeaters for the proposition that Jack is angry. If PC is true, Jill will now have justification for believing that Jack is angry, arising directly from the mere appearance of Jack’s being angry. Some find this result counter-intuitive, since it allows an initially unjustified belief to indirectly generate justification for itself.

Phenomenal conservatives try to explain away this intuition. Skene (2013, section 5.1) suggests that the objectors may confuse the evaluation of the belief with that of the person who holds the belief in the sort of example described above, and that the person should be adjudged irrational but her belief judged rational. Tucker (2010, p. 540) suggests that the person possesses justification but lacks another requirement for knowledge and is epistemically blameworthy (compare Huemer 2013a, pp. 747-8). Huemer (2013b, pp. 343-5) argues that the subject has a justified belief in this sort of case by appealing to an analogy involving a subject who has a hallucination caused (unbeknownst to the subject) by the subject’s own prior action.

d. Inferential Justification

Suppose S bases a belief in some proposition P on (his belief in) some evidence E. Suppose that the inference from E to P is fallacious, such that E in fact provides no support at all for P (E neither entails P nor raises the probability of P). S, however, incorrectly perceives E as supporting P, and thus, S’s belief in E makes it seem to S that P must be true as well. (It does not independently seem to S that P is true; it just seems to S that P must be true given E.) Finally, assume that S has no reason for thinking that the inference is fallacious, even though it is, nor has S any other defeaters for P. It seems that such a scenario is possible. If so, one can raise the following objection to PC:

1. In the described scenario, S is not justified in believing P.

2. If PC is true, then in this scenario, S is justified in believing P.

3. So PC is false.

Many would accept premise (1), holding that an inferential belief is unjustified whenever the inference on which the belief is based is fallacious. (2) is true, since in the described scenario, it seems to S that P, while S has no defeaters for P. (For an objection along these lines, see Tooley 2013, p. 323.)

One possible response to this objection would be to restrict the principle of phenomenal conservatism to the case of non-inferential beliefs and to hold a different view (perhaps some variation on PC) of the conditions for inferential beliefs to be justified.

Another alternative is to maintain that in fact, fallacious inferences can result in justified belief. Of course, if a person has reason to believe that the inference on which he bases a given belief is fallacious, then this will constitute a defeater for that belief. It is consistent with phenomenal conservatism that the belief will be unjustified in this case. So the only cases that might pose a problem are those in which a subject makes an inference that is in fact fallacious but that seems perfectly good to him, and he has no reason to suspect that the inference is fallacious or otherwise defective. In such a case, one could argue that the subject rationally ought to accept the conclusion. If the subject refused to accept the conclusion, how could he rationally explain this refusal? He could not cite the fact that the inference is fallacious, nor could he point to any relevant defect in the inference, since by stipulation, as far as he can tell the inference is perfectly good. Given this, it would seem irrational for the subject not to accept the conclusion (Huemer 2013b, p. 339).

Here is another proposed condition on doxastic justification: if S believes P on the basis of E, then S is justified in believing P only if S is justified in believing E. This condition is very widely accepted. But again, PC seems to flout this requirement, since all that is needed is for S’s belief in E to cause it to seem to S that P (while S lacks defeaters for P), which might happen even if S’s belief in E is unjustified (McGrath 2013, section 5; Markie 2013, section 2).

A phenomenal conservative might try to avoid this sort of counterexample by claiming that whenever S believes P on the basis of E and E is unjustified, S has a defeater for P. This might be true because (i) per epistemological internalism, whenever E is unjustified, the subject has justification for believing that E is unjustified, (ii) whenever S’s belief that P is based on E, the subject has justification for believing that his belief that P is based on E, and (iii) the fact that one’s belief that P is based on an unjustified premise would be an undercutting defeater for the belief that P.

Alternately, and perhaps more naturally, the phenomenal conservative might again restrict the scope of PC to noninferential beliefs, while holding a different (but perhaps closely related) view about the justification of inferential beliefs (McGrath 2013, section 5; Tooley 2013, section 5.2.1). For instance, one might think that in the case of a non-inferential belief, justification requires only that the belief’s content seem true and that the subject lack defeaters for the belief; but that in the case of an inferential belief, justification requires that the premise be justifiedly believed, that the premise seem to support the conclusion, and that the subject lack defeaters for the conclusion (Huemer 2013b, p. 338).

5. Summary

Among the most central, fundamental questions of epistemology is that of what, in general, justifies a belief. Phenomenal Conservatism is among the major theoretical answers to this question: at bottom, beliefs are justified by “appearances,” which are a special type of experience one reports when one says “it seems to me that P” or “it appears to me that P.” This position is widely viewed as possessing important theoretical virtues, including the ability to offer a very simple account of many kinds of justified belief while avoiding troublesome forms of philosophical skepticism. Some proponents lay claim to more controversial advantages for the theory, such as the unique ability to avoid self-defeat and to accommodate central internalist intuitions.

The theory remains controversial among epistemologists for a variety of reasons. Some harbor doubts about the reality of a special type of experience called an “appearance.” Others believe that an appearance cannot provide justification unless one first has independent evidence of the reliability of one’s appearances. Others cite alleged counterexamples in which appearances have irrational or otherwise unreliable sources. And others object that phenomenal conservatism seems to flout widely accepted necessary conditions for inferential justification.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, David. 1961. Perception and the Physical World. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • BonJour, Laurence. 1985. The Structure of Empirical Knowledge. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • BonJour, Laurence. 2004. “In Search of Direct Realism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 69, 349-367.
    • Early objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Brogaard, Berit. 2013. “Phenomenal Seemings and Sensible Dogmatism.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 270-289). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. 1957. Perceiving: A Philosophical Study. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Chapter 4 offers a widely cited discussion of three uses of “appears” and related terms.
  • Conee, Earl. 2013. “Seeming Evidence.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 52-68). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Cullison, Andrew. 2010. “What Are Seemings?” Ratio 23, 260-274.
  • DePaul, Michael. 2009. “Phenomenal Conservatism and Self-Defeat.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 78, 205-212.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism, especially the self-defeat argument.
  • DePoe, John. 2011. “Defeating the Self-defeat Argument for Phenomenal Conservativism.” Philosophical Studies 152, 347–359.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism, especially the self-defeat argument.
  • Foley, Richard. 1983. “Epistemic Conservatism.” Philosophical Studies 43, 165-182.
    • Objections to doxastic conservatism.
  • Foley, Richard. 1993. Working without a Net. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fumerton, Richard. 1995. Metaepistemology and Skepticism. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Hanna, Nathan. 2011. “Against Phenomenal Conservatism.” Acta Analytica 26, 213-221.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2001. Skepticism and the Veil of Perception. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
    • Chapter 5 defends phenomenal conservatism and contains a version of the self-defeat argument. This is the original source of the term “phenomenal conservatism.”
  • Huemer, Michael. 2005. Ethical Intuitionism. New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
    • Chapter 5 uses phenomenal conservatism to explain moral knowledge.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2006. “Phenomenal Conservatism and the Internalist Intuition.” American Philosophical Quarterly 43, 147-158.
    • Defends phenomenal conservatism using internalist intuitions.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2007. “Compassionate Phenomenal Conservatism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 74, 30-55.
    • Defends phenomenal conservatism using the self-defeat argument. Responds to BonJour 2004.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2009. “Apology of a Modest Intuitionist.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 78, 222-236.
    • Responds to DePaul 2009.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2013a. “Epistemological Asymmetries Between Belief and Experience.” Philosophical Studies 162, 741-748.
    • Responds to Siegel 2013.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2013b. “Phenomenal Conservatism Uber Alles.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 328-350). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Responds to several critiques of phenomenal conservatism found in the same volume.
  • Hume, David. 1975. “An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding.” In L. A. Selby-Bigge (ed.), Enquiries Concerning Human Understanding and Concerning the Principles of Morals. Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Littlejohn, Clayton. 2011. “Defeating Phenomenal Conservatism.” Analytic Philosophy 52, 35-48.
    • Argues that PC may lead one to endorse terrorism and cannibalism.
  • Lycan, William. 2013. “Phenomenal Conservatism and the Principle of Credulity.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 293-305). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Lyons, Jack. 2011. “Circularity, Reliability, and the Cognitive Penetrability of Perception.” Philosophical Issues 21, 289-311.
  • Markie, Peter. 2005. “The Mystery of Direct Perceptual Justification.” Philosophical Studies 126, 347-373.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Markie, Peter. 2006. “Epistemically Appropriate Perceptual Belief.” Noûs 40, 118-142.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Markie, Peter. 2013. “Searching for True Dogmatism.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 248-268). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • McGrath, Matthew. 2013. “Phenomenal Conservatism and Cognitive Penetration: The ‘Bad Basis’ Counterexamples.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 225-247). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Uses the cognitive penetration counterexamples to motivate a modification of phenomenal conservatism.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1997. The Problems of Philosophy. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Siegel, Susanna. 2013. “The Epistemic Impact of the Etiology of Experience.” Philosophical Studies 162, 697-722.
    • Criticizes phenomenal conservatism and related views using the tainted source objection.
  • Skene, Matthew. 2013. “Seemings and the Possibility of Epistemic Justification.” Philosophical Studies 163, 539-559.
    • Defends the self-defeat argument for phenomenal conservatism and offers an account of why epistemic justification must derive from appearances.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1998. “Minimal Intuition.” In Michael DePaul and William Ramsey (eds.), Rethinking Intuition (pp. 257-270). Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Steup, Matthias. 2013. “Does Phenomenal Conservatism Solve Internalism’s Dilemma?” In Chris Tucker (eds.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 135-153). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Swinburne, Richard. 2001. Epistemic Justification. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Tolhurst, William. 1998. “Seemings.” American Philosophical Quarterly 35, 293-302.
    • Discusses the nature of seemings.
  • Tooley, Michael. 2013. “Michael Huemer and the Principle of Phenomenal Conservatism.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 306-327). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Objections to phenomenal conservatism.
  • Tucker, Chris. 2010. “Why Open-Minded People Should Endorse Dogmatism.” Philosophical Perspectives 24, 529-545.
    • Defends phenomenal conservatism, appealing to its explanatory power.
  • Tucker, Chris. 2013. “Seemings and Justification: An Introduction.” In Chris Tucker (ed.), Seemings and Justification: New Essays on Dogmatism and Phenomenal Conservatism (pp. 1-29). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

 

Author Information

Michael Huemer
Email: owl232@earthlink.net
University of Colorado
U. S. A.

Dynamic Epistemic Logic

This article tells the story of the rise of dynamic epistemic logic, which began with epistemic logic, the logic of knowledge, in the 1960s. Then, in the late 1980s, came dynamic epistemic logic, the logic of change of knowledge. Much of it was motivated by puzzles and paradoxes. The number of active researchers in these logics grows significantly every year, possibly because there are so many relations and applications to computer science, to multi-agent systems, to philosophy, and to cognitive science. The modal knowledge operators in epistemic logic are formally interpreted by employing binary accessibility relations in multi-agent Kripke models (relational structures), where these relations should be equivalence relations to respect the properties of knowledge.

The operators for change of knowledge correspond to another sort of modality, more akin to a dynamic modality. A peculiarity of this dynamic modality is that it is interpreted by transforming the Kripke structures used to interpret knowledge, and not, at least not on first sight, by an accessibility relation given with a Kripke model. Although called dynamic epistemic logic, this two-sorted modal logic applies to more general settings than the logic of merely S5 knowledge. The present article discusses in depth the early history of dynamic epistemic logic. It then mentions briefly a number of more recent developments involving factual change, one (of several) standard translations to temporal epistemic logic, and a relation to situation calculus (a well-known framework in artificial intelligence to represent change). Special attention is then given to the relevance of dynamic epistemic logic for belief revision, for speech act theory, and for philosophical logic. The part on philosophical logic pays attention to Moore sentences, the Fitch paradox, and the Surprise Examination.

For the main body of this article, go to Dynamic Epistemic Logic.

Author Information

Hans van Ditmarsch, LORIA, CNRS – University of Lorraine, France
Wiebe van der Hoek, The University of Liverpool, United Kingdom
Barteld Kooi, University of Groningen, Netherlands

 

Infinitism in Epistemology

This article provides an overview of infinitism in epistemology. Infinitism is a family of views in epistemology about the structure of knowledge and epistemic justification. It contrasts naturally with coherentism and foundationalism. All three views agree that knowledge or justification requires an appropriately structured chain of reasons. What form may such a chain take? Foundationalists opt for non-repeating finite chains. Coherentists (at least linear coherentists) opt for repeating finite chains. Infinitists opt for non-repeating infinite chains. Appreciable interest in infinitism as a genuine competitor to coherentism and foundationalism developed only in the early twenty-first century.

The article introduces infinitism by explaining its intuitive motivations and the context in which they arise. Next it discusses the history of infinitism, which is mostly one of neglect, punctuated by brief moments of hostile dismissal. Then there is a survey of arguments for and against infinitism.

For the most part, philosophers have assumed that knowledge requires justified belief. That is, for some proposition (statement, claim or sentence) P, if you know that P, then you have a justified belief that P. Knowledge that P thus inherits its structure from the structure of the constituent justified belief that P. If the justified belief is inferential, then so is the knowledge. If the justified belief is “basic,” then so is the knowledge. These assumptions are taken for granted in the present article.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Historical Discussion of Infinitism
  3. Contemporary Arguments for Infinitism
    1. The Features Argument
    2. Regress Arguments
      1. The Enhancement Argument
      2. The Interrogation Argument
    3. The Proceduralist Argument
  4. Common Objections to Infinitism
    1. The Finite Mind Objection
    2. The Proof of Concept Objection
    3. The AC/DC Objection
    4. The Unexplained Origin Objection
    5. The Misdescription Objection
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Further Reading

1. Introduction

We often provide reasons for the things we believe in order to justify holding the beliefs. But what about the reasons? Do we need reasons for holding those reasons? And if so, do we need reasons for holding those reasons that were offered as reasons for our beliefs? We're left to wonder:

Does this regress ever end?

Infinitism is designed to answer that question. Given that one of the goals of reasoning is to enhance the justification of a belief, Q, infinitism holds that there are two necessary (but not jointly sufficient) conditions for a reason in a chain to be capable of enhancing the justification of Q:

  1. No reason can be Q itself, or equivalent to a conjunction containing Q as a conjunct. That is, circular reasoning is excluded.
  2. No reason is sufficiently justified in the absence of a further reason. That is, there are no foundational reasons.

If both (1) and (2) are true, then the chain of reasons for any belief is potentially infinite, that is, potentially unlimited.

The reason for accepting (1), and thereby rejecting circular reasoning as probative, that is, as tending to prove, is that reasoning ought to be able to improve the justificatory status of a belief. But if the propositional content of a belief is offered as a reason for holding the belief, then no additional justification could arise. Put more bluntly, circular reasoning begs the question by positing the very propositional content of the belief whose justificatory status the reasoning is designed to enhance.

Condition (1) is generally accepted, although some coherentists seem to condone the sort of circular reasoning that it proscribes (for example, Lehrer 1997). However, these coherentists might not actually be denying (1). Rather, they might instead be claiming that it is epistemically permissible to offer a deliverance of a cognitive faculty as a reason for believing that the faculty produces justified beliefs. On this alternative reading, these coherentists don't deny (1), because (1) concerns the structure, not the source, of probative reasons. For example, suppose you employ beliefs produced by perception as reasons for believing that perception is reliable. This need not involve employing the proposition “perception is reliable” as one of the reasons.

Condition (2) is much more controversial. Indeed, denying (2) is a component of the dominant view in epistemology: foundationalism. Many foundationalists claim that there are beliefs, so-called “basic beliefs” or “foundational beliefs,” which do not require further reasons in order to function effectively as reasons for “non-basic” or “non-foundational” beliefs. Basic beliefs are taken to be sufficiently justified to serve as, at least, prima facie reasons for further beliefs in virtue of possessing some property that doesn't arise from, or depend on, being supported by further reasons. For example, the relevant foundationalist property could be that the belief merely reports the contents of sensations or memories; or it could be that the belief is produced by a reliable cognitive faculty. The general foundationalist picture of epistemic justification is that foundational beliefs are justified to such an extent that they can be used as reasons for further beliefs, and that no reasons for the foundational beliefs are needed in order for the foundational beliefs to be justified.

Infinitists accept (2) and so deny that there are foundational beliefs of the sort that foundationalists champion. The motivation for accepting (2) is the specter of arbitrariness. Infinitists grant that in fact every actually cited chain of reasons ends; but infinitists deny that there is any reason which is immune to further legitimate challenge. And once a reason is challenged, then on pain of arbitrariness, a further reason must be produced in order for the challenged reason to serve as a good reason for a belief.

In addition to denying the existence of so-called basic beliefs, infinitism takes reasoning to be a process that generates an important type of justification — call it “reason-enhanced justification.” In opposition to foundationalism, reasoning is not depicted as merely a tool for transferring justification from the reasons to the beliefs. Instead, a belief's justification is enhanced when sufficiently good reasons are offered on its behalf. Such enhancement can occur even when the reasons offered have not yet been reason-enhanced themselves. That is, citing R as a reason for Q can make one's belief that Q reason-enhanced, even though R, itself, might not yet have been reason-enhanced.

As mentioned above, infinitists reject the form of coherentism – sometimes called “linear coherentism” – that endorses question-begging, circular reasoning. But by allowing that reasoning can generate epistemic justification, infinitists partly align themselves with another, more common form of coherentism – often called “holistic coherentism.” Holistic coherentism also accepts that reasoning can generate reason-enhanced justification (see BonJour 1985, Kvanvig 2007). As the name “holistic coherentism” indicates, epistemic justification is taken to be a property of entire sets of beliefs, rather than a property of individual beliefs. Holistic coherentism holds that individual beliefs are justified only in virtue of their membership in a coherent set of beliefs. On this view, justification does not transfer from one belief to another, as foundationalists or linear coherentists would claim; rather, the inferential relationships among beliefs in a set of propositions generates a justified set of beliefs; individual beliefs are justified merely in virtue of being members of such a set. Sosa (1991, chapter 9) raises serious questions about whether holistic coherentism is ultimately merely just a disguised version of foundationalism; and if Sosa is correct, then some of the objections to foundationalism would apply to holistic coherentism as well.

The argument pattern for infinitism employs the epistemic regress argument and, thus, infinitists defend their view in a manner similar to the way in which foundationalism and coherentism have been defended. This is the pattern:

  1. There are three possible, non-skeptical solutions to the regress problem: foundationalism, coherentism and infinitism.
  2. There are insurmountable difficulties with two of the solutions (in this case, foundationalism and coherentism).
  3. The third view (in this case, infinitism) faces no insurmountable difficulties.
  4. Therefore, the third view (in this case, infinitism) is the best non-skeptical solution to the regress problem.

2. Historical Discussion of Infinitism

The term ‘epistemic infinitism’ was used by Paul Moser in 1984, and the phrase "infinitist's claim" was used by John Post in 1987. Both philosophers rejected infinitism.

Infinitism was well known by the time of Aristotle – and he rejected the view. The empiricist and rationalist philosophers of the 17th and 18th centuries rejected the view. Contemporary foundationalists and coherentists reject the view.

Indeed, it is fair to say that the history of infinitism is primarily a tale of neglect or rejection, with the possible exception of Charles Pierce (Aikin 2011, pp. 80–90; see also “Some Questions Concerning Certain Faculties Claimed for Man” in Peirce 1965, v. 5, bk. 2, pp. 135–155, esp. pp. 152–3). Some have questioned whether Peirce was defending infinitism (BonJour 1985, p. 232, n. 10; Klein 1999, pp. 320–1, n. 32). There has been some recent interest in infinitism, beginning when Peter Klein published the first in a series of articles defending infinitism (Klein 1998). But it clearly remains in the early 21st century a distinctly minority view about the structure of reasons.

Ever since Aristotle proposed objections to infinitism and defended foundationalism, various forms of foundationalism have dominated Western epistemology. For example, consider the epistemologies of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries; this is the formative period in which modern philosophy shaped the issues addressed by contemporary epistemologists. Both the empiricists and rationalists were foundationalists, although they clearly disagreed about the nature of foundational reasons.

Consider this passage from Descartes's Meditation One, where he explains his method of radical doubt:

But in as much as reason already persuades me that I ought no less carefully to withhold my assent from matters which are not entirely certain and indubitable than from those which appear to me manifestly to be false, if I am able to find in each one some reason to doubt, this will suffice to justify rejecting the whole. And for that end it will not be requisite that I should examine each in particular, which would be an endless undertaking; for owing to the fact that the destruction of the foundations of necessity brings with it the downfall of the rest of the edifice, I shall only in the first place attach those principles upon which all my former opinions rest. (Descartes 1955 [1641], p. 145)

After producing a “powerful” reason for doubting all of his former beliefs based on his senses, Descartes begins his search anew for a foundational belief that is beyond all doubt and writes in Meditation Two:

Archimedes, in order that he might draw the terrestrial globe out of its place, and transport it elsewhere demanded only that one point should be fixed and unmovable; in the same way I shall have the right to conceive high hopes if I am happy enough to discover one thing only which is certain. (Descartes 1955 [1641], p. 149)

He then happily produces what he takes—at least at that point in the Meditations – to be that one, foundational proposition:

So that after having reflected well and carefully examined all things we must come to the definite conclusion that this proposition: I am, I exist, is necessarily true each time I pronounce it, or that I mentally conceive it. (Descartes 1955 [1641], p. 150)

Regardless of the success or failure of his arguments, the point here is that Descartes clearly takes it as given that both he and the empiricist, his intended foil, will accept that knowledge is foundational and that the first tasks are to identify the foundational proposition(s) and to uncover the correct account of the nature of the foundational proposition(s). Once that is accomplished, the second task is to move beyond it (or them) to other beliefs by means of truth-preserving inferences. The Meditations presupposes a foundationalist model of reasons without any hint of argument for foundationalism.

Now consider this passage from Hume:

In a word, if we proceed not upon some fact present to the memory or senses, our reasonings would be merely hypothetical; and however the particular links might be connected with each other the whole chain of inferences would have nothing to support it, nor could we ever, by its means arrive at the knowledge of any real existence. If I ask you why you believe a particular matter of fact which you relate, you must tell me some reason; and this reason will be some other fact connected with it. But as you cannot proceed after this manner in infinitum, you must at last terminate with some fact which is present to your memory or senses or must allow that your belief is entirely without foundation. (Hume 1955 [1748], pp. 59–60)

Setting aside an evaluation of the steps in Hume's argument for foundationalism, notice that he too simply discards infinitism with the stroke of a pen: “But as you cannot proceed in this manner in infinitum ...”. To Hume, infinitism seemed so obviously mistaken that no argument against it was needed.

So why did infinitism come to be so easily and so often rejected?

The short answer is: Aristotle. His arguments against infinitism and for foundationalism were so seemingly powerful that nothing else needed to be said. We can divide Aristotle's objections to infinitism into three types. Each pertains to the infinitist solution to the regress problem.

  • Misdescription Objection: Infinitism does not correctly describe our epistemic practices; but foundationalism does.
  • Finite Mind Objection: Our finite minds are not capable of producing or grasping an infinite set of reasons.
  • Unexplained Origin Objection: Infinitism does not provide a good account of how justification is generated and transferred by good reasoning; but foundationalism does.

We will return Aristotle's objections below, in section 4.

3. Contemporary Arguments for Infinitism

There are three main contemporary arguments for infinitism.

a. The Features Argument

Infinitism has been defended on the grounds that it alone can explain two of epistemic justification's crucial features: it comes in degrees, and it can be complete (Fantl 2003). This argument concerns propositional justification, rather than doxastic justification. Propositional justification is a matter of having good reasons; doxastic justification is typically thought to be a matter of properly believing based on those reasons.

For purposes of this argument, understand infinitism as the view that a proposition Q is justified for you just in case there is available to you an infinite series of non-repeating reasons that favors believing Q. And understand foundationalism as the view that Q is justified for you just in case you have a series of non-repeating reasons that favors believing Q, terminating in a properly basic foundational reason “that needs no further reason.” And further suppose that infinitism and foundationalism are the only relevant non-skeptical alternatives for a theory of epistemic justification, so that if skepticism about justification is false, then either infinitism or foundationalism is true.

The features argument is based on two features of justification. First, justification comes in degrees. We can be more or less justified in believing some claim. An adequate theory of justification must respect this, and explain why justification comes in degrees. Call this the degree requirement on an acceptable theory of justification. Second, it's implausible to identify adequate justification with complete justification. Adequate justification is the minimal degree of justification required for knowledge. Complete justification is maximal justification, beyond which justification cannot be increased or strengthened. An adequate theory of justification should explain how justification could be complete. Call this the completeness requirement on an acceptable theory of justification.

Infinitism satisfies the degree requirement by pointing out that length comes in degrees, which justification may mirror. Other things being equal, the longer the series of reasons you have for believing Q, the better justified Q is for you (as long as the shorter set is a proper subset of the longer set). Infinitism can satisfy the completeness requirement by offering an account of complete justification: Q is completely justified for you just in case you have an infinite array of adequate reasons (Fantl 2003: 558). To have an infinite array of reasons favoring Q, for each potential challenge to Q, or to any of the infinite reasons in the chain supporting Q, or to any of the inferences involved in traversing any link in the chain, you must have available a further infinite series of reasons. In short, it requires having an infinite number of infinite chains.

Can foundationalism meet the degree and completeness requirements? To assess this, we need first to explain how foundationalists understand foundational reasons. Traditional foundationalists contend that foundational reasons are self-justifying, because their mere truth suffices to justify them. The claims “I am thinking” and “There is at least one proposition that is neither true nor false” are plausible candidates for self-justifying reasons. Metajustificatory foundationalists deny that the mere truth of a foundational reason ensures its foundational status. Instead, they say, foundational reasons must have some other property, call it ‘F’. Metajustificatory foundationalists disagree among themselves over what F is. Some say it is reliability, others say it is coherence, and yet others say it is clear and distinct perception or social approval. The important point to recognize is that metajustificatory foundationalism can't “require that a believer have access to the metajustificatory feature as a reason for the foundational reason,” because that would undermine its putative status as foundational (Fantl 2003: 541). It would effectively require a further reason for that which supposedly stood in no need of it.

Having divided all foundationalists into two jointly exhaustive and mutually exclusive groups, the argument against foundationalism goes like this:

  1. All foundationalist theories are either traditional or metajustificatory. (Premise)
  2. Traditional foundationalism can't satisfy the degree requirement. (Premise)
  3. Metajustificatory foundationalism can't satisfy the completeness requirement. (Premise)
  4. So no foundationalist theory can satisfy both the degree and completeness requirements (From 1–3)
  5. An adequate theory of justification must satisfy both the degree and completeness requirements. (Premise)
  6. So no foundationalist theory of justification is adequate. (From 4–5)

The argument is valid. Line 1 is trivially true, given the way the categories are defined. Line 2 is supported on the grounds that all self-justifying reasons are by definition true, and their truth justifies them. But truth doesn't come in degrees. So traditional foundationalism lacks the resources to satisfy the degree requirement. Truth isn't flexible enough.

Line 3 is supported on the grounds that the foundationalist will have to analyze complete justification along these lines:

Q is completely justified for you iff you have a non-repeating series of reasons for Q, ultimately founded on a reason that exemplifies the metajustificatory feature [F] to the highest possible degree. (Fantl 2003: 546)

But any such proposal must fail for a simple reason: no matter what F is, if you gain a reason to think that the foundational reason completely exemplifies F, and that exemplifying F is epistemically important, then Q will thereby become better justified for you. To see why, for the sake of argument suppose that we accept a reliabilist version of metajustificatory foundationalism, according to which Q is completely justified for you if and only if you have a non-repeating series of reasons for Q, ultimately founded on a perfectly reliable reason. Now if you gain a reason to believe that the reason is perfectly reliable, then Q will thereby become better justified for you. But then metajustificatory foundationalism hasn't satisfied the completeness requirement after all, because it will be possible for you to increase your justification for Q beyond what the maximal exemplification of F would allow. But this violates the definition of complete justification. So metajustificatory foundationalism can't meet the completeness requirement.

In response, foundationalists have pointed out that the reasoning in support of line 2 of the argument is undermined to the extent that a degree-theoretic conception of truth is plausible — that is, to the extent it's plausible that truth comes in degrees. Foundationalists have also responded that the supporting reasoning for line 3 overlooks the possibility of adequate justification being over-determined. The more reasons you have that independently adequately justify Q for you, the better justified Q is for you. A natural foundationalist proposal, then, is that Q is completely justified for you if and only if it is infinitely over-determined that Q is adequately justified for you (Turri 2010).

b. Regress Arguments

There are at least two regress arguments for infinitism: the enhancement argument and the interrogation argument. Each concerns a very specific epistemic status closely connected to reasons and reasoning. Neither purports to establish that infinitism is true about all interesting epistemic statuses. Although infinitists take skepticism seriously, for the purposes of these two arguments, we'll simply assume that skepticism is false.

i. The Enhancement Argument

The enhancement argument begins by asking a question (Klein 2005): What sort of reasoning could enhance the justification of a non-evident proposition, in a context where its truth has been legitimately questioned? What structural form would the reasons offered in the course such reasoning take? We can divide all answers to that question into three groups. Enhancement coherentists answer that some repeating chains could enhance justification; enhancement foundationalists answer that no repeating chain could enhance justification, but some finite and non-repeating chains could; enhancement infinitists answer that no repeating or finite chain could enhance justification, but some infinite and non-repeating chains could.

The enhancement argument for infinitism is that neither coherentism nor foundationalism provides a satisfactory answer to the question posed, whereas infinitism does. Given that these three answers exhaust the (non-skeptical) alternatives, it follows that infinitism is the only satisfactory account of the epistemic status in question, which for convenience we can call rational enhancement of justification.

The objection to enhancement coherentism is that repeating chains are objectionably question-begging and so can't rationally enhance justification. If Corrie believes Q, and someone asks her, “Why believe Q?”, and she responds by citing a chain of reasoning that relies on Q itself, then in that context she has clearly done nothing to rationally enhance her justification for Q. Her response simply presupposes the claim in question, so how could it rationally enhance her justification?

Enhancement foundationalists claim that some reasons are special: the foundational enhancers. Foundational enhancers can rationally enhance the justification for believing other things, even though they are not rationally supported by further reasons in turn. This is why some finite chains can rationally enhance justification: a foundational enhancer appropriately terminates the affair.

The objection to enhancement foundationalism is that all finite chains are objectionably arbitrary at their terminus. Suppose that Fontana believes A, and someone asks him, “Why believe A?”, and he responds by citing some reason B. But B is not a foundational enhancer, and Fontana is in turn asked, “Why believe B?” This continues until Fontana reaches the point where he cites a reason that, according to him, is a foundational enhancer. Let Z be this purported foundational enhancer. Fontana's interlocutor presses further, “Why think that foundational enhancers are likely to be true?” In response to this last question, Fontana has three options: affirm, deny, or withhold. If he denies, then using Z as a reason is arbitrary and the reasoning can't rationally enhance A for him. If he withholds, then, from his own point of view, he should not use Z as the basis for further beliefs. If it is not good enough to affirm in and of itself, then it isn't proper to use it as a basis for affirming something else. If he affirms, then there is no immediate problem, but this is because the reasoning has continued, and what was supposed to be a foundational enhancer turned out not to be one.

Enhancement infinitism avoids the problems faced by coherentism and foundationalism. It endorses neither circular reasoning nor arbitrary endpoints.

The enhancement argument for infinitism can be understood as follows:

  1. If skepticism about rational enhancement is false, then either coherentism, foundationalism or infinitism is the correct theory of rational enhancement. (Premise)
  2. Skepticism about rational enhancement is false. (Premise)
  3. Coherentism isn't the correct theory. (Premise)
  4. Foundationalism isn't the correct theory. (Premise)
  5. So infinitism is the correct theory of rational enhancement. (From 1–4)

Line 1 is true because the way that coherentism, foundationalism and infinitism are characterized exhausts logical space. Every rationally enhancing chain is either circular or not. If it is circular, then it's a coherentist chain; if it isn't, then either it is finite or infinite. If it is finite, then it is a foundationalist chain; if it is infinite, then it is an infinitist chain. Line 2 is assumed without defense in the present context, as mentioned above. Lines 3 and 4 are defended on grounds already explained: line 3 on the grounds that circular reasoning can rationally enhance justification, and line 4 on the grounds that arbitrary reasoning can't do so either.

ii. The Interrogation Argument

The interrogation argument concerns “the most highly prized form of true belief” (Plato, Meno, 98a), which is the sort of knowledge that human adults take themselves to be capable of and sometimes even attain (Klein 2011). More specifically, the interrogation argument concerns one of the essential requirements of this sort of knowledge, namely, full justification.

A key idea in the infinitist's discussion here is that distinctively human knowledge is distinguished by the importance of reasoning in attaining full justification: we make our beliefs fully justified by reasoning in support of them. The reasoning is partly constitutive of full justification, and so is essential to it. A mechanical calculator might know that 2+2=4, and a greyhound dog might know that his master is calling, but neither the calculator nor the greyhound reasons in support of their knowledge. Their knowledge is merely mechanical or brute. Adult humans are capable of such unreasoned knowledge, but we are also capable of a superior sort of knowledge involving full justification, due to the value added by reasoning.

The interrogation argument is motivated by a specific version of the regress problem, which emerges from an imagined interrogation. Suppose you believe that Q. Then someone asks you a legitimate question concerning the basis of your belief that Q. You respond by citing reason R1. You are then legitimately asked about your basis for believing R1. You cite reason R2. Then you are legitimately asked about your basis for believing R2. A pattern is emerging. How, if it all, can the reasoning resolve itself such that you're fully justified in believing Q? Either the process goes on indefinitely, which suggests that the reasoning you engage in is fruitless because another reason is always needed; or some reason is repeated in the process, which means that you reasoned circularly and thus fruitlessly; or at some point the reasoning ends because the last reason cited isn't supported by any other reason, which suggests that the reasoning is fruitless because it ends arbitrarily. No matter how the reasoning resolves itself, it seems, you're no better offer for having engaged in it. Thus, it can seem doubtful that any reasoning will result in a fully justified belief.

This is essentially the argument given by Sextus Empiricus (1976, lines 164-170, p. 95) to motivate a version of Pyrrhonian Skepticism. What are we to make of this problem? The infinitist agrees that circular reasoning is fruitless, and that finite reasoning ends arbitrarily and so is fruitless too. However, the infinitist disagrees with the claim that reasoning that goes on indefinitely must be fruitless. Every belief is potentially susceptible to legitimate questioning, and interrogation can, in principle, go on indefinitely. You need to be able to answer legitimate questions, and so you need available to you an indefinite number of answers. Each answer is a further reason. So, far from seeming fruitless, potentially indefinitely long reasoning seems to be exactly what is needed for the reasoning to be epistemically effective and result in full justification.

The interrogation argument for infinitism can be summarized like so:

  1. Adult human knowledge requires full justification.(Premise)
  2. Full justification requires proper reasoning. (Premise)
  3. Proper reasoning requires that there be available an infinite and non-repeating series of reasons. (Premise)
  4. So adult human knowledge requires that there be available an infinite and non-repeating series of reasons. (From 1–3)

Lines 1 and 2 can be understood as stipulating the epistemic status that the infinitist is interested in, as explained above. Line 3 is defended on the grounds that (a) circular reasoning is illegitimate, and (b) finite chains won't suffice because every reason offered is potentially susceptible to legitimate interrogation, and full justification requires that an answer to every legitimate question be at least available to you. Foundationalists point to beliefs with an allegedly special foundational property F, which, it is claimed, suites them to put a definitive end to legitimate questioning. But, the infinitist responds, foundationalists always pick properties that they think are truth-conducive, and it is always, potentially at least, legitimate to ask, “Why think that reasons with the property F are truth-conducive?” Once this legitimate question is raised, the foundationalist must abandon the supposed foundational citadel, in search of further reasons. But this looks suspiciously like infinitism in disguise.

c. The Proceduralist Argument

The proceduralist argument for infinitism pertains to knowledge. It begins from the premise that knowledge is a “reflective success” (Aikin 2009). Reflective success requires succeeding through proper procedure. Proper procedure requires thinking carefully. Moreover, we can make our careful thinking explicit. To make our careful thinking explicit is to state our reasons. And for a reason to legitimately figure into our careful thinking, we must have a reason for thinking that it is true in turn.

We can encapsulate the proceduralist argument for infinitism like so:

  1. Knowledge is a reflective success. (Premise)
  2. Reflective success requires careful thinking. (Premise)
  3. Careful thinking requires the availability of an infinite series of reasons. (Premise)
  4. So knowledge requires the availability of an infinite series of reasons. (From 1–3)

Lines 1 and 2 can be understood as characterizing the sort of knowledge that the infinitist is interested in. (Aikin 2005 and 2009 strongly suggests that this is knowledge ordinarily understood, though the matter is not entirely clear.) Line 3 is defended by appeal to a guiding intuition, namely, that if you know, then you can properly answer all questions about your belief and your reasons. But in principle there are an infinite number of questions about your belief and your reasons. And no proper answer will implicate you in question-begging circularity. So, in principle you need an infinite number of answers (Aikin 2009: 57–8). If there were a proper stopping point in the regress of reasons, then beliefs at the terminus would not be susceptible to legitimate challenges from those who disagree. Your opponents would be simply mistaken for challenging you at this point. But it doesn't seem like there even is a point where your opponents must be simply mistaken for challenging you.

What about the examples featured prominently by foundationalists? For example, what about your belief that 2+2=4, or that you have a headache (when you do have one)? It can easily seem implausible that a challenge to these beliefs must be legitimate. It can easily seem that someone who questioned you on these matters would be simply mistaken. The infinitist disagrees. We always should be able to offer reasons. At the very least, careful thinking requires us to have an answer to the question, “Are our concepts of a headache or addition fit for detecting the truth in such matters?” Even if we think there are good answers to such questions, the infinitist claims, the important point is that we need those answers in order to think carefully and, in turn, gain knowledge.

Infinitism can appear counterintuitive because, as a matter of fact, we never answer very many questions about any of our beliefs, but we ascribe knowledge to people all the time. But this an illusion because we often carelessly attribute knowledge, or attribute knowledge for practical reasons that aren't sensitive to the attribution's literal truth.

4. Common Objections to Infinitism

a. The Finite Mind Objection

For most cases of effective reasoning, justified belief or knowledge, infinitism requires more of us than we can muster. We have finite lives and finite minds. Given the way that we are actually constituted, we cannot produce an infinite series of reasons. So skepticism is the immediate consequence of any version of infinitism that requires us to produce an infinite series of reasons (Fumerton 1995; compare BonJour 1976: 298, 310 n. 22).

In a remark in the Posterior Analytics reflecting his general worries about regresses, Aristotle gives a reason for rejecting infinitism: “one cannot traverse an infinite series.” But if one cannot traverse an infinite series of reasons, then if infinitism is the correct account of justification, then skepticism is the correct view. We cannot traverse an infinite series of reasons because we have finite minds. It is useful to quote the passage in full, because it is also a famous passage advocating a regress argument for foundationalism.

Aristotle expresses dissatisfaction with both infinitism and question-begging coherentism, and so opts for foundationalism. He writes:

Some hold that, owing to the necessity of knowing primary premisses, there is no scientific knowledge. Others think there is, but that all truths are demonstrable. Neither doctrine is either true or a necessary deduction from the premisses. The first school, assuming that there is no way of knowing other than by demonstration, maintain that an infinite regress is involved, on the ground that if behind the prior stands no primary, we could not know the posterior through the prior (wherein they are right, for one cannot traverse an infinite series [emphasis added]); if on the other hand – they say – the series terminates and there are primary premisses, yet these are unknowable because incapable of demonstration, which according to them is the only form of knowledge.

And since thus [sic] one cannot know the primary premisses, knowledge of the conclusions which follow from them is not pure scientific knowledge nor properly knowing at all, but rests on the mere supposition that the premisses are true. The other party agree with them as regards to knowing, holding that it is possible only by demonstration, but they see no difficulty in holding that all truths are demonstrated on the ground that demonstration may be circular or reciprocal. (72b5–18)

Aristotle here focuses on “scientific knowledge” and syllogistic “demonstration.” But his remarks are no less plausible when taken to apply to all knowledge and reasoning. Aristotle himself hints at this with his comment about “knowing at all.”

The spirit of Aristotle's original finite-mind objection is alive and well in contemporary epistemology. Here is a representative example:

The [proposed] regress of justification of S's belief that p would certainly require that he hold an infinite number of beliefs. This is psychologically, if not logically, impossible. If a man can believe an infinite number of things, then there seems to be no reason why he cannot know an infinite number of things. Both possibilities contradict the common intuition that the human mind is finite. Only God could entertain an infinite number of beliefs. But surely God is not the only justified believer. (Williams 1981, p. 85)

But infinitists have been careful not to claim that we must actually produce an infinite series of reasons. Rather, they typically say that we must have an appropriately structured, infinite set of reasons available to us. About this milder infinitist requirement, it might be worried that it's not clear that we could even understand an infinite series of reasons. But being able to understand a series of reasons is required for that series to be available — at least in some senses of “available” — to us as reasons. So, even this milder infinitist requirement might lead to skepticism.

b. The Proof of Concept Objection

Contrary to what was suggested at the end of the previous objection, it seems that we could understand an infinite series, provided that each element in the series was simple enough. And it doesn't seem impossible for a justificatory chain to include only simple enough elements.

Grant that it's possible that every element of an infinite series could be comprehensible to us. But what evidence is there that there actually are such series? And what evidence is there that, for at least most of the things that we justifiably believe (or most of the things we know, or most of the acceptable reasoning we engage in), there is a properly structured infinite series available to us? Unless infinitists can convincingly respond to these questions — unless they can offer a proof of concept — then it seems likely that infinitism leads to skepticism.

The objection can be made more poignant by pairing it with the finite mind objection. To handle the finite mind objection, infinitists deny that you need to actually produce the infinite series of reasons in order for your belief to be justified. Just having the reasons available, and producing enough of them to satisfy contextual demands, suffices to justify your belief. But since contextual demands are never so stringent as to demand more than, say, ten reasons, we're left with no actual example of a chain that seems a promising candidate for an infinite series (Wright 2011: section 3).

At least one example has been given of a readily available infinite chain of reasons, but ironically it is one compatible with foundationalism, offered by a foundationalist in response to infinitism (Turri 2009). (Peijnenburg and Atkinson 2011 sketch some formal possibilities and provide an analogy with heritable traits.)

c. The AC/DC Objection

For any proposition we might believe, both it and its denial can be supported by similar, appropriately structured infinite chains of reasons (Post 1980 32–7; Aikin 2005: 198–9; Aikin 2008: 182–3). Importantly, neither chain of reasons is, in any meaningful sense, more available to us than the other. To appreciate the point, suppose you are inquiring into whether P. An infinite affirming chain could be constructed like so:

Affirmation chain (AC)

Q & (Q → P)

R & (R → (Q & (Q → P)))

S & (S → (R & (R → (Q & (Q → P)))))

whereas an infinite denial chain could be constructed like so:

Denial chain (DC)

Q & (Q → ~P)

R & (R → (Q & (Q → ~P)))

S & (S → (R & (R → (Q & (Q → ~P)))))

It is an equally long way to the top of each chain, but which is, so to speak, the road to epistemic heaven, and which the road to hell? Having one such chain available to you isn't a problem, but having both available is a touch too much (at least in non-paradoxical cases), and infinitism lacks the resources to eliminate one.

A further worry is that if infinitists embrace additional resources to eliminate one of these chains, those very same resources could in turn form the basis of a satisfactory finitist epistemology (Cling 2004: section 5). Aikin 2008 defends a version of infinitism, “impure infinitism,” intended to address this problem by incorporating elements of foundationalism; and Klein has argued that specifying the conditions for the availability of reasons will eliminate the possibility of both chains being available in non-paradoxical cases.

d. The Unexplained Origin Objection

Aristotle begins the Posterior Analytics with this statement: “All instruction given or received by way of argument proceeds from pre-existent knowledge.” And later in the Posterior Analytics, after having rejected both infinitism and question-begging coherentism as capable of producing knowledge, he writes:

Our own doctrine is that not all knowledge is demonstrative; on the contrary, knowledge of the immediate premisses is independent of demonstration. (The necessity of this is obvious; for since we must know the prior premisses from which the demonstration is drawn, and since the regress must end in immediate truths, those truths must be indemonstrable.) Such, then, is our doctrine, and in addition we maintain that besides scientific knowledge there is an originative source which enables us to recognize the definitions [that is, the first principles of a science].(72b18–24)

What is this “originative source” and how does it produce knowledge not based on reasoning? The answer is a proto-reliabilist one that relies on humans having a “capacity of some sort” (99b33) that produces immediate (non-inferential) knowledge. Although most contemporary reliabilists will not take the foundational propositions employed in demonstration to be the first principles of a science, they will take foundational beliefs to result from the operation of some capacities humans possess that do not employ conscious reasoning (Goldman 2008).

Here is Aristotle's account of the “originating source” of justified beliefs:

But though sense-perception is innate in all animals, in some perception comes to persist, in others it does not. So animals in which this persistence does not come to be have either no knowledge at all outside of the act of perceiving, or no knowledge of objects of which no impression persists; animals in which it does come into being have perception and can continue to retain the sense-impression in the soul; and when such persistence is frequently repeated a further distinction at once arises between those which out of persistence of such sense impressions develop a power of systematizing them and those which do not. So out of sense perception comes to be what we call memory, and out of frequently repeated memories of the same thing develops experience; for a number of memories constitute a single experience. From experience … originate the skill of the craftsman and the knowledge of the man of science. (99b36–100a5)

Thus, Aristotle holds that foundationalism can explain how justification can arise in basic beliefs and how it is transmitted through reasoning to non-foundational beliefs. This, he claims, contrasts with infinitism and question-begging coherentism, which have no way of explaining how justification arises. He seems to assume that reasoning cannot originate justification, but can merely transmit it. If each belief were to depend on another for its justification, then there would be no originative source, or starting point, that generates the justification in the first place.

Writing in the second century AD, Sextus Empiricus wondered how we might show that believing a proposition is better justified than the alternatives of either disbelieving it or suspending judgment. He employed the “unexplained origin objection” to reject an infinitist attempt to show how believing could be better justified. He argues that infinitism must lead to suspension of judgment.

The Mode based upon regress ad infinitum is that whereby we assert that the thing adduced as a proof of the matter proposed needs a further proof, and this another again, and so on ad infinitum, so that the consequence is suspension [of judgment], as we possess no starting-point for our argument.(1976, I:164–9)

The unexplained origin objection remains popular today. Carl Ginet, a contemporary foundationalist, puts it this way:

A more important, deeper problem for infinitism is this: Inference cannot originate justification, it can only transfer it from premises to conclusion. And so it cannot be that, if there actually occurs justification, it is all inferential. (Ginet 2005, p. 148)

Jonathan Dancy, another contemporary foundationalist, makes a similar point:

Suppose that all justification is inferential. When we justify belief A by appeal to belief B and C, we have not yet shown A to be justified. We have only shown that it is justified if B and C are. Justification by inference is conditional justification only; A's justification is conditional upon the justification of B and C. But if all justification is conditional in this sense, then nothing can be shown to be actually non-conditionally justified. (Dancy 1985, p. 55)

e. The Misdescription Objection

In the Metaphysics, Aristotle writes:

There are … some who raise a difficulty by asking, who is to be the judge of the healthy man, and in general who is likely to judge rightly on each class of questions. But such inquiries are like puzzling over the question whether we are now asleep or awake. And all such questions have the same meaning. These people demand that a reason shall be given for everything; for they seek a starting point, and they seek to get this by demonstration, while it is obvious from their actions that they have no such conviction. But their mistake is what we have stated it to be; they seek a reason for things for which no reason can be given; for the starting point of demonstration is not demonstration. (1011a2–14)

The point of this objection is that, assuming that skepticism is false, infinitism badly misdescribes the structure of reasons supporting our beliefs, as revealed by or expressed in our actual deliberative practices. Our actual practices do not display what infinitism would predict (again, assuming that skepticism is false).

Of the three objections to infinitism presented by Aristotle, this one has gained the least traction in contemporary epistemology. This might be because it rests on two easily challenged assumptions: (i) a theory of justification can be tested by determining whether our actual deliberations meet its demands; (ii) our actual deliberations meet foundationalism's demands. Regarding (i), can we test an ethical theory by determining whether our actual behavior meets its demands? (Let us hope not!) If not, then why should we accept (i)? Regarding (ii), would a foundationalist accept the following as a foundational proposition: “The train schedule says so”? Such claims often end deliberation about when the next train departs. But it's not the sort of proposition that foundationalists have taken to be basic.

5. References and Further Reading

a. References

  • Aikin, S., 2005, “Who Is Afraid of Epistemology's Regress Problem,” Philosophical Studies 126: 191–217.
  • Aikin, S., 2008, “Meta-epistemology and the Varieties of Epistemic Infinitism,” Synthese 163: 175–185.
  • Aikin, S., 2009, “Don't Fear the Regress: Cognitive Values and Epistemic Infinitism,” Think Autumn 2009: 55–61.
  • Aikin, S., 2011, Epistemology and the Regress Problem, Routledge.
  • Aristotle, Metaphysics.
  • Aristotle, Posterior Analytics.
  • BonJour, L., 1976, “The Coherence Theory of Empirical Knowledge,” Philosophical Studies 30: 281–312.
  • Cling, A., 2004, “The Trouble with Infinitism,” Synthese 138: 101–123.
  • Dancy, J., 1985, Introduction to Contemporary Epistemology, Blackwell.
  • Descartes, R., 1955 [1641], Meditations on First Philosophy, in Philosophical Works of Descartes, trans. and ed. By E.S. Haldane and G.R.T. Ross, v. 1, Dover.
  • Fantl, J., 2003, “Modest Infinitism,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 33: 537–62.
  • Fumerton, R., 1995, Metaepistemology and Skepticism, Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Ginet, C., 2005, “Infinitism is Not the Solution to the Regress Problem,” Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, ed. M. Steup and E. Sosa, Blackwell.
  • Goldman, A., 2008, “Immediate Justification and Process Reliabilism,” Epistemology: New Essays, ed. Q. Smith, Oxford University Press.
  • Hume, D., 1955 [1748], An Inquiry Concerning Human Understanding, ed Charles Hendel, Bobbs-Merrill Company.
  • Klein, P., 1998, “Foundationalism and the Infinite Regress of Reasons,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58: 919-925.
  • Klein, P., 1999, “Human Knowledge and the Infinite Regress of Reasons,” J. Tomberlin, ed., Philosophical Perspectives 13: 297-325.
  • Klein, P., 2005, “Infinitism is the Solution to the Regress Problem,” in M. Steup and E. Sosa, eds., Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, Blackwell.
  • Klein, P., 2012, “Infinitism and the Epistemic Regress Problem,” in S. Toldsdorf, ed., Conceptions of Knowledge, de Gruyter.
  • Lehrer, K., 1997, Self-Trust, Oxford University Press.
  • Moser, P., 1984, “A Defense of Epistemic Intuitionism,” Metaphilosophy 15: 196–209.
  • Peijnenburg, J. and D. Atkinson, 2011, “Grounds and Limits: Reichenbach and Foundationalist Epistemology,” Synthese 181: 113–124
  • Peirce, C.S., 1965, Collected papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, ed. Charles Hartshorne and Paul Weiss, Harvard University Press.
  • Plato, Meno.
  • Post, J., 1980, “Infinite Regresses of Justification and of Explanation,” Philosophical Studies 38: 31–52.
  • Post, J., 1984, The Faces of Existence, Cornell University Press.
  • Sextus Empiricus, 1976, Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Harvard University Press.
  • Sosa, E., 1991, Knowledge in Perspective, Cambridge University Press.
  • Turri, J., 2009, “On the Regress Argument for Infinitism,” Synthese 166: 157–163.
  • Turri, J., 2010, “Foundationalism for Modest Infinitists,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 40: 275–284.
  • Wright, S., 2011, “Does Klein's Infinitism Offer a Response to Agrippa's Trilemma?” Synthese, DOI 10.1007/s11229-011-9884-x.

b. Further Reading

  • Atkinson, D. and J. Peijnenburg, 2009, “Justification by an Infinity of Conditional Probabilities,” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 50: 183–93.
  • Coffman, E.J. and Howard-Snyder, D. 2006, “Three Arguments Against Foundationalism: Arbitrariness, Epistemic Regress, and Existential Support,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 36.4: 535–564.
  • Ginet, C., “Infinitism is not the Solution to the Regress Problem,” in M. Steup and E. Sosa, eds., Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, Blackwell.
  • Klein, P., 2000, “The Failures of Dogmatism and a New Pyrrhonism,” Acta Analytica 15: 7-24.
  • Klein, P., 2003a, “How a Pyrrhonian Skeptic Might Respond to Academic Skepticism,” S. Luper, ed., The Skeptics: Contemporary Essays, Ashgate Press.
  • Klein, P., 2003b, “When Infinite Regresses Are Not Vicious,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 66: 718-729.
  • Klein, P., 2004a, “There is No Good Reason to be an Academic Skeptic,” S. Luper, ed., Essential Knowledge, Longman Publishers.
  • Klein, P., 2004b, “What IS Wrong with Foundationalism is that it Cannot Solve the Epistemic Regress Problem,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 68: 166-171.
  • Klein, P., 2005b, “Infinitism's Take on Justification, Knowledge, Certainty and Skepticism,” Veritas 50: 153-172.
  • Klein, P., 2007a, “Human Knowledge and the Infinite Progress of Reasoning,” Philosophical Studies 134: 1-17.
  • Klein, P., 2007b, “How to be an Infinitist about Doxastic Justification,” Philosophical Studies 134: 25-29.
  • Klein, P., 2008, “Contemporary Responses to Agrippa's Trilemma,” J. Greco, ed., The Oxford Handbook of Skepticism, Oxford University Press.
  • Klein, P., 2011, “Infinitism,” S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard, eds., Routledge Companion to Epistemology, Routledge.
  • Peijnenburg, J., 2007, “Infinitism Regained,” Mind 116: 597–602.
  • Peijnenburg, J., 2010, “Ineffectual Foundations: Reply to Gwiazda,” Mind 119: 1125–1133.
  • Peijnenburg, J. and D. Atkinson, 2008, “Probabilistic Justification and the Regress Problem,” Studia Logica 89: 333–41.
  • Podlaskowski, A.C. And J.A. Smith, 2011, “Infinitism and Epistemic Normativity,” Synthese 178: 515–27.
  • Turri, J., 2009, “An Infinitist Account of Doxastic Justification,” Dialectica 63: 209–18.
  • Turri, J., 2012, “Infinitism, Finitude and Normativity,” Philosophical Studies, DOI: 10.1007/s11098-011-9846-7.

 

Author Information

Peter D. Klein
Email: pdklein@rci.rutgers.edu
Rutgers University, New Brunswick
U. S. A.

and

John Turri
Email: John.turri@gmail.com
University of Waterloo
Canada

Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description

Our own experiences of pain are better known to us than the bio-chemical structure of our brains. Some philosophers hold that this difference is due to different kinds of knowledge: knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description. I have first-hand or direct knowledge of my own experiences; whereas I have only second-hand or indirect knowledge of my brain’s being in a particular bio-chemical state. These two different kinds of knowledge indicate an essential difference in one’s awareness of certain kinds of truths. There is, however, considerable controversy among philosophers whether this distinction can consistently be applied and whether generally knowledge by acquaintance offers a stronger or better perspective on one’s knowledge than other kinds of knowledge.

Some philosophers distinguish knowledge by acquaintance from knowledge by description roughly along the following lines: knowledge by acquaintance is a unique form of knowledge where the subject has direct, unmediated, and non-inferential access to what is known whereas knowledge by description is a type of knowledge that is indirect, mediated, and inferential. There are some significant philosophical issues in spelling out how exactly to make this distinction and even whether it is possible to maintain that there is a privileged kind of knowledge by acquaintance. Nonetheless, many philosophers have put this distinction to work in issues related to epistemology and philosophy of mind.

Table of Contents

  1. The Distinction: Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description
  2. The Epistemology of Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description
    1. Bertrand Russell
    2. Recent Accounts
    3. Criticisms
    4. Replies
  3. The Philosophy of Mind and Knowledge by Acquaintance
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. The Distinction: Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description

The concept of acquaintance was introduced to contemporary philosophy by Bertrand Russell in his seminal article “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description” (1910) and in chapter five of The Problems of Philosophy (1912) (although see Russell 1905, pp. 479-480, 492-493 for an earlier passing discussion of it). Russell explains that a person is acquainted with an object when he stands in a “direct cognitive relation to the object, i.e. when [the subject is] directly aware of the object itself” (Russell 1910, p. 108). In another place, he writes “we have acquaintance with anything of which we are directly aware, without the intermediary of any process of inference or any knowledge of truths” (Russell 1912, p. 46). To have knowledge by acquaintance, according to Russell, occurs when the subject has an immediate or unmediated awareness of some propositional truth. Knowledge by description, by contrast, is propositional knowledge that is inferential, mediated, or indirect.

The traditional account of knowledge by acquaintance is susceptible to being misunderstood or conflated with merely being directly acquainted with something (on this point see Russell 1914, p. 151). It is important to notice that there is a difference between being directly acquainted with something and having knowledge by acquaintance that something is the case. For a subject to be directly acquainted with something only requires for the subject to have unmediated access to the object of awareness.  Knowledge by acquaintance that something is the case, however, is more than being directly acquainted with something’s being the case. Knowledge by acquaintance, after all, is a kind of knowledge, which requires the subject to hold a belief under the right conditions. For a subject to be directly acquainted with something does not necessarily require the subject to hold a belief about it. Notice the difference in the following claims:

(1) S is directly acquainted with p

and

(2) S knows by direct acquaintance that p.

Propositions (1) and (2) do not mean the same thing. The truth-conditions for (1) are different than the truth-conditions for (2). In order for (1) to be true, it needs to be the case that the subject is in fact acquainted with p. For example, when p is the fact that one is experiencing a mild pain, all it takes for (1) to be true is that the subject has some unmediated access or awareness of his pain experience.  However, for (2) to be true, more is required. Some person may be directly acquainted with his mild pain experience but fail to have knowledge that he is having a pain experience, perhaps by failing to attend to this experience in such a way that he forms a propositional belief on the basis of his direct acquaintance with the pain experience. (Consider the possibility of an animal--perhaps a fish or a worm--that has the capacity to be acquainted with its pains, but lacks the capacity to form any propositional attitudes.) Thus, (1) may be a necessary condition for (2), but it would be hasty to conclude that (1) is sufficient for (2) or that (1) and (2) are equivalent. The subject needs to be aware of no propositional content about p to satisfy (1). But in order to satisfy (2), the subject needs to have a belief with propositional content about p, which is properly based on his direct acquaintance with p.

2. The Epistemology of Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description

The epistemological issues involving the distinction, knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description, have focused primarily on whether there is privileged unmediated knowledge by acquaintance. I begin with Russell’s epistemic use of the distinction, and then I will survey some contemporary accounts of knowledge by acquaintance. Finally, to round out this overview of the epistemic applications of this distinction I will highlight a couple of criticisms of classical accounts of knowledge by acquaintance and responses to them.

a. Bertrand Russell

Russell used the distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and description to articulate a foundationalist epistemology where knowledge by acquaintance is the most basic kind of knowledge and knowledge by description is inferential (Russell 1910 and 1912, ch. 5). “All our knowledge,” wrote Russell, “rests upon acquaintance for its foundation” (Russell 1912, p. 48). Knowledge by acquaintance, therefore, is a direct kind of knowledge; it is a kind of knowledge that does not depend on inference or mediation. The test Russell employs for determining what someone knows by acquaintance is based on dubitability. For this reason, Russell maintained a person cannot know by acquaintance that physical objects, like an iPod, exist; after all, even when someone is seeing an iPod, it is possible to doubt whether the iPod exists (due to the possibilities of dreaming, illusion, hallucination, and so forth). The sense data, or sensory experiences, of an iPod, however, cannot consistently be doubted by a person who is experiencing them. Thus, sense data can be known by acquaintance, whereas physical objects cannot.  Russell also believed that one could be directly acquainted with memory experiences, introspective experiences (awareness of one’s own direct acquaintances and other internal sensations), universals, and (probably) even one’s own self (see Russell 1912, ch. 5; however, for one place where he is less confident of being directly acquainted with the self, see his 1914, p. 81).

On Russell’s view one cannot know by acquaintance that physical objects exist. Consequently, knowledge by description provides the only possibility of knowing physical objects. Knowledge by description, according to Russell, is dependent on direct acquaintance in at least two ways. First, knowledge by description depends on acquaintance for its propositional content. Russell unequivocally stated, “every proposition which we can understand must be composed wholly of constituents with which we are acquainted” (Russell 1912, p. 58). Although one’s knowledge by description may concern objects that outstrip the range of one’s immediate acquaintance, the propositional content is composed of concepts with which the subject is directly acquainted.

There is a similarity between the way one can know something about particular things outside of one’s experience and the way Russell envisioned knowledge by description to allow a person to think about physical objects. Consider the belief that the tallest living man in the world exists. Someone can form this belief, even though he may have no clue who this individual is. Understanding the concepts of being the tallest, being alive, and being a man are sufficient for allowing a person to hold this belief, even though its referent may lie beyond the set of people that one has met first-hand. Likewise, Russell believed that one could form beliefs about physical objects, despite the fact that one cannot ever be directly acquainted with them. When a person holds the belief, for example, that there is a cup of coffee, he is not directly acquainted with the coffee as a physical object, but he is able to think about the physical object through descriptions with which he is directly acquainted. The descriptive content might consist of there being an object that is the cause of his experiences of blackness, bitterness, hotness, and liquidness. On Russell’s account, the subject’s acquaintance with the right concepts allows him to form beliefs about physical objects.

The second way in which knowledge by description depends on acquaintance is that knowledge by description is inferentially dependent on knowledge by acquaintance. In other words, the propositions one knows by description ultimately are inferred from one’s propositional knowledge by acquaintance. Consequently, this gives rise to a foundationalist epistemology in which all of one’s knowledge is either foundational or inferentially based on foundational knowledge. It is well-known that Russell believed one’s knowledge of the world beyond his or her own mind needed to be inferred from more basic knowledge of one’s own mental experiences (see Russell 1912, ch. 2 and Russell 1914). This raises the difficulty for Russell’s position of how to provide a plausible account of this inferential relationship between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description in a way that successfully accommodates the commonsense notion that most people know that physical objects exist.

b. Recent Accounts

Since Russell, much work has been advanced in his name promoting and applying the distinction of knowledge by acquaintance and description to use in epistemology. On the one hand, there have been traditional acquaintance theorists who have more-or-less kept the original Russellian conception of knowledge by acquaintance; namely the view that one is directly acquainted with one’s own states of mind and not the extra-mental world. Brie Gertler helpfully characterizes contemporary accounts of knowledge by acquaintance as involving judgments that are (a) tied directly to their truthmakers, (b) depend only on the subject’s conscious states of mind for their justification, and (c) are more strongly justified than any empirical judgments that are not directly tied to their truthmakers and dependent only on conscious states of mind for their justification (Gertler 2012, p. 99). The traditional position on knowledge by acquaintance has been most influentially promulgated by the works of Richard Fumerton and Laurence BonJour (for other accounts related to the traditional approach see Balog 2012, Chalmers 2003, Fales 1996, Feldman 2004, Gertler 2001, Gertler 2011, Gertler 2012, Hasan forthcoming, and Pitt 2004).

Fumerton has proposed the following three conditions as necessary and sufficient for knowledge by acquaintance: (i) S is directly acquainted with the fact that p; (ii) S is directly acquainted with the thought that p; and (iii) S is directly acquainted with the correspondence that holds between the fact that p and the thought that p (Fumerton 1995, pp. 73-79). These three acquaintances parallel the requirements for a proposition’s being true (on a correspondence theory of truth): (a) the truth-maker (S is directly acquainted with the fact that p); (b) the truth-bearer (S is directly acquainted with the thought that p); and (c) the correspondence relation (S is directly acquainted with the correspondence between the fact that p and the thought that p). Given the subject’s direct acquaintance with (i), (ii), and (iii), he is directly acquainted with everything necessary to constitute being directly acquainted with a true proposition.

To the extent that BonJour provides an account of knowledge by acquaintance, it is directed exclusively to basic empirical beliefs. BonJour describes his theory of basic empirical justification as taking place when a person directly apprehends that his experience fits or satisfies the description offered by the content of his belief (BonJour 2001; BonJour 2003, especially pp. 60-76, 191-193; BonJour uses the language of “direct acquaintance” in 2001, while he prefers “direct apprehension” in 2003). It is the subject’s ability to have a direct acquaintance or apprehension of the contents of one’s own conscious experiences and how they fit or satisfy the content of one’s basic beliefs that makes knowledge by acquaintance possible. BonJour stresses, however, that fallibility can occur due to the subject’s misapprehension of one’s experience or failure to see the fit between the experience and the belief.  Despite the possibility of error, he believes that this does not undermine genuine cases when a subject does correctly apprehend the character of experience and sees its fit with one’s basic belief.

On the other hand, there are non-traditional acquaintance theorists who have modified knowledge by acquaintance in such a way that one can be acquainted with and know physical objects directly (such as Brewer 2011). Another deviation from the Russellian tradition is to maintain that knowledge by acquaintance is a different kind of knowledge than propositional knowledge (Tye 2009, pp. 95-102). On this non-propositional approach to knowledge by acquaintance, there is a sense in which one can be said to know something with which one is acquainted, even though the person does not necessarily have any propositional belief states about the thing that is said to be known by acquaintance.

c. Criticisms

Perhaps the most influential problem raised for knowledge by acquaintance is commonly called the problem of the speckled hen (due to Gilbert Ryle as reported by Chisholm 1942). The problem arises by considering the case where someone looks at a hen with exactly 48 speckles on one side. Yet, the perceiver’s experience is not adequate grounds for him to distinguish an experience of a hen with exactly 47 or 49 speckles. Indeed, even if someone were to hold the belief that one’s experience is of a hen with exactly 48 speckles, it would by most standards fail to count as knowledge because the subject could have easily formed a false belief (for example, that the hen has 47 or 49 speckles) on the basis of being acquainted with that very experience (for one way to understand this epistemic principle see “The Safety Condition for Knowledge”). In other words, typically people cannot distinguish between having a visual experience of a 47, 48, or 49 speckled hen. However, if a person is directly acquainted with these experiences and can plausibly satisfy the other conditions required for knowledge by acquaintance, then cases of this sort stand as potential counterexamples to possessing knowledge or justification through direct acquaintance. Given the indiscernibility of the contents of mental states through direct acquaintance, this raises doubts whether one’s justification based on direct acquaintance can offer some unique, privileged state of knowledge. After all, one motivation for accepting knowledge by acquaintance is that the subject’s knowledge of his own mental states may be indubitable, whereas other kinds of knowledge cannot. The problem of the speckled hen challenges the idea that one may fail to have indubitable justification through knowledge by acquaintance because for just about any putative mental state with which one is acquainted, since there may be a different mental state that is virtually indistinguishable from it. It even raises the question whether these closely related states constitute genuinely different experiences for the subject at all.

The problem of the speckled hen has continued to challenge contemporary accounts of knowledge by acquaintance (see Sosa 2003a, 2003b; Markie 2009; Poston 2010). The challenge, as Sosa puts it, is for the acquaintance theorist to “tell us which sorts of features of our states of consciousness are epistemically effective ones, the ones such that by corresponding to them specifically that our basic beliefs acquire epistemically foundational status” (Sosa 2003, pp. 277-278, similar remarks can be found in Sosa 2003b, p.121). Here the concern is that the acquaintance theorist has no principled way of explaining why one’s acquaintance with a simple mental state (for example, an experience of three black dots against a white background) is able to ground a justified belief, whereas one’s acquaintance with a complex mental state (for example, a hen with 48 speckles) fails to serve as appropriate grounds for a justified belief. The problem is for acquaintance theorists to provide a plausible account of the conditions and limits of knowledge by acquaintance that naturally explains cases like the speckled hen.

A second influential problem for knowledge by acquaintance is due to Wilfrid Sellars. Sellars (1963) famously critiqued the possibility of acquiring non-inferentially justified beliefs through some privileged, direct relation to one’s sensory experience. The problem that Sellars has raised can be put in terms of a dilemma (for a recent defense of this type of dilemma, see Williams 1999). The dilemma focuses on whether the conscious experiential states of mind are propositional or non-propositional. If, on the one hand, mental experiences are non-propositional, then it is mysterious (at best) to explain how a belief can derive any justification from a non-propositional basis. Donald Davidson expresses the core intuition behind this horn of the dilemma: “nothing can count as a reason for holding a belief except another belief” (1986, p. 126). The central claim at the crux of this side of the dilemma is that only propositional entities can stand in logical or justificatory relations to other propositional entities.

On the other side of the dilemma, if one accepts that mental experiences are propositional, then the problem for acquaintance theorists is to explain how one is justified in accepting the propositional content of experiences. Defenders of this objection stress that this horn of the dilemma pushes the problem of generating non-inferential justification back a step. If beliefs derive their justification from the propositional contents of experiences, then experiences too must derive their justification from some other appropriate source of propositional content. Contrary to the kind of foundationalism proposed by the acquaintance theorist, this horn of the dilemma essentially states that mental experiences do not constitute a non-arbitrary way to stop the regress of justification needed to arrive at a foundational bedrock for empirical knowledge or justification.

Thus, the Sellarsian dilemma appears to leave no viable alternative for the defender of direct acquaintance: (i) if experiences are non-propositional, then they cannot stand in justificatory relations to propositional beliefs; (ii) if experiences are propositional, then there must be some further basis for one to be justified in holding the propositional content of the experiences. The first option alleges that deriving justification from non-propositional content is mysterious and inexplicable. The second option alleges that granting propositional content to experiences does not stop the regress of reasons. Either way, the foundational and unique role that is supposed to be filled by knowledge by acquaintance is undermined.

d. Replies

In response to the problem of the speckled hen, Fumerton (2005) has suggested a variety of options available to the acquaintance theorist. First, it is possible that knowledge by acquaintance fails in cases like the speckled hen because the subject fails to have an acquaintance with the correspondence that holds between the character of his experience and the thought that the experience has a specific character (compare Poston 2007). Recall that on the traditional account, knowledge by acquaintance requires more than only being acquainted with the truth-maker for one’s belief, it also involves some kind of awareness of the correspondence or fit that holds between one’s thought and the experience that is the basis for one’s thought. A second proposal is based on phenomenal concepts (compare Feldman 2004). A phenomenal concept is a concept that one can immediately recognize (for example, being three-sided) as opposed to a concept that involves a process of thought to recognize (for example, being 27-sided). Restricting knowledge by acquaintance to belief-states involving phenomenal concepts can accommodate the challenge of the speckled hen by plausibly maintaining that the concept of being 48-speckled is not a phenomenal concept and thereby not a candidate for knowledge by acquaintance. Third, one can maintain that there are degrees between determinate and determinable properties with which one is acquainted (compare Fales 1996, pp. 173-180). Properties fall on a continuum between being more general to being more specific or determined. For example, a ripe tomato’s surface can be described generally as colored, more determinately as red, or even more determinately as vermilion. Given this distinction in the determinateness of properties, it is possible that one could be directly acquainted with differing degrees of determinable properties. If experiences can instantiate varying degrees of these determinable properties (and this is a matter of controversy that cannot be addressed here), then in cases like the speckled hen the acquaintance theorist may hold that the subject is not directly acquainted with the experience of a hen with 48 speckles but with the experience having a less determinate property such as the property of being many-speckled. Thus, in cases akin to the speckled hen, the subject may not be acquainted with the property of being 48-speckled, but with a less determinate property like being many-speckled.

Another proposed solution to the problem of the speckled hen follows from distinguishing between the phenomenal and epistemic appearances of an experience (Gertler 2011, pp. 103-106). The phenomenal appearance of an experience is determined by the properties that constitute the experience. The epistemic appearance of an experience is what the experience inclines the subject to believe. For example, if someone takes a white plate and holds it under a green light, the plate phenomenally appears green (that is, the property of being green partly constitutes the experience of the plate) but with sufficient knowledge of the effects of green lighting on white objects, it does not epistemically appear green (that is, the subject is not inclined to think that the plate is green). In cases like the speckled hen, then, the experience may phenomenally appear to be 48-speckled, but it may only epistemically appear to be many-speckled. The key to this solution is disambiguating the meaning of “appearance” to explain how in one sense the subject may have an appearance of a hen with 48 speckles (phenomenally) and in another sense the subject may not have an appearance of a hen with 48 speckles (epistemically).

With respect to the Sellarsian dilemma, one response takes the horn of the dilemma that states propositional beliefs derive their justification from non-propositional experiences. For instance, Fumerton (1995, pp. 74-76) proposes an account of knowledge by acquaintance (see above section 2b) where the subject is in a position to know a truth through three acquaintances. Since acquaintance by itself is not an epistemic concept in need of justification, it enables the subject to be appropriately related to the source of one’s justification without necessitating further levels of justification. Thus, in response to the challenge to explain how non-propositional experiences (such as the raw experience of searing pain) can justify propositional thoughts (such as the belief that I am experiencing pain), Fumerton maintains that justification is made possible by being directly acquainted with the relation of correspondence that holds between the non-propositional experience and the propositional thought.

BonJour offers another influential response to Sellars’s dilemma (2001, pp. 28-34; 2003, especially pp. 69-74). On BonJour’s account of basic empirical knowledge (see above section 2b), the awareness or apprehension of the justification for one’s belief is built-in or partly constitutive of the justifying non-conceptual experience. While non-conceptual experiences do not stand in certain kinds of logical relations (for example, inferring) to conceptual beliefs, there is a relation of description or fit that holds between experiences and beliefs. Since certain kinds of experiences have a built-in awareness of their contents, these experiences contain within themselves a kind of reason for thinking that the given description accurately fits. The crucial move in BonJour’s solution is to see that the built-in awareness renders the basic empirical belief justified without any further need for justification.

Staunch defenders of the Sellarsian dilemma will likely remain unimpressed with these responses. The problem, they might urge, is that these alleged solutions push the problem back a level. Those defending the dilemma will press these proposals to explain how propositional beliefs can correspond or accurately describe non-propositional experiences. In some places, Fumerton and BonJour seem to suggest that first-hand experience with our own conscious states of mind adequately demonstrate how these relations are able to hold (Fumerton 1995, p. 77; BonJour 2003, pp. 69-74).

Other friends of direct acquaintance have suggested that experiences, while being non-propositional, may have a propositional structure (or proto-propositional structure) that allows for propositional content to map onto it (Fales 1996, pp. 166-169). For example, a non-propositional experience may be constituted by presenting particulars exemplifying specific properties, which naturally provides a structure resembling statements in the subject-predicate form. Timothy McGrew contends that basic empirical beliefs can be formed by indexically referring to one’s non-propositional experience as part of what constitutes the propositional content of the belief (1995, especially pp. 89-90). By embedding the non-propositional content as a constituent part of the belief (for example, “I am being appeared to thusly”), it is possible to show how non-propositional experiences may provide a basis for forming justified propositional beliefs (for some concerns about the richness of indexically formed beliefs to serve as a foundation see Sosa 2003b, especially pp. 122-124).

3. The Philosophy of Mind and Knowledge by Acquaintance

While knowledge by acquaintance has its most immediate application to philosophical topics in epistemology, it has increasingly been applied to issues in metaphysics, especially in the philosophy of mind. In particular, knowledge by acquaintance has played a role in the knowledge argument against physicalism. Some argue that knowledge of qualia is direct and unmediated, which provides an insight into the nature of the mind that cannot be known through the physical sciences. Frank Jackson presents this argument through a compelling thought experiment about Mary (Jackson 1982; 1986). Mary is a scientist who learns all the physical truths from her exhaustive study of the completed physics. For whatever reasons, Mary has lived her entire life without experiencing any colors besides black, white, and shades of gray. One day after she has mastered all the physical truths and everything that can be deduced a priori from them, Mary leaves her black-and-white environment and sees a ripe tomato.  Intuitively, it seems that Mary learns something new with this experience; she learns this is what it’s like to have a red experience. Since Mary knew all the physical truths prior to seeing the ripe tomato and since Mary learned something new about the world after seeing the ripe tomato, the implication of the thought experiment, then, is that physicalism is false.

More recently David Chalmers has made use of knowledge by acquaintance to support property dualism in the same vein as the knowledge argument. His arguments rely in part on the notion that our direct knowledge of phenomenal conscious states justifies our beliefs about them (see Chalmers 1996, especially pp. 196-198; 2004; 2007). Among his arguments is the case from the asymmetry between one’s knowledge of consciousness and the rest of the world (Chalmers 1996, pp. 101-103). A person’s knowledge of consciousness is based on first-hand, direct experiences of it, not evidence that is external to one’s immediate access. His argument, roughly stated, is that since subjects know by acquaintance that phenomenal consciousness exists and possesses certain features, and this knowledge cannot be deduced a priori from one’s knowledge of physical truths, it follows that these features of conscious experience are not physical.

Some philosophers have attempted to defend physicalist theories of mind with the notion of knowledge by acquaintance, albeit by employing a non-traditional approach to knowledge by acquaintance (compared to the traditional approach as described in section 1 and section 2). Generally these approaches have endorsed that knowledge by acquaintance is nothing more than a subject’s being directly acquainted with a property or fact, and they have deviated from the traditional position that knowledge by acquaintance requires propositional belief (see Conee 1994 and Tye 2009). Those who use knowledge by acquaintance to defend physicalism claim that the knowledge argument only highlights two different ways of knowing the same thing. One way this case has been made is by suggesting that one can know all the propositional truths about something (for example, the city of Houston) and yet not know it directly. The difference between knowledge of phenomenal consciousness and knowledge of brain states is like the difference between knowing about Houston (by reading a very thorough visitor’s guide) and knowing Houston directly (by visiting the city). According to these views, it is because knowledge by acquaintance is a different kind of knowledge that phenomenal knowledge appears to differ from descriptive, physical knowledge about brain states. Although there is not space for a full evaluation of these views, one problem that has been raised is that knowledge by acquaintance cannot by itself account for the epistemic disparity that this solution is attempting to solve (see Nida-Rümelin 1995; Gertler 1999). In other words, the problem is that there appears to be propositional, factual content about the properties of conscious experience that these non-standard accounts of knowledge by acquaintance fail to capture.

4. Conclusion

The distinction between knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description has a number of important applications in philosophy. In epistemology, it underwrites a tradition from Bertrand Russell that continues to influence debates on the nature of foundationalism and the possibility of a privileged class of knowledge. In metaphysics, knowledge by acquaintance has increasingly been incorporated into arguments concerning the nature of conscious experience and the viability of physicalism. The current trend suggests that knowledge by acquaintance will continue to be refined and put to work on a variety of philosophical fronts.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Balog, K. 2012. “Acquaintance and the Mind-Body Problem.” In Simone Gozzano and Christopher Hill (eds.), New Perspectives on Type Identity: The Mental and the Physical (pp. 16-43). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • BonJour, L. 2001. “Toward a Defense of Empirical Foundationalism.” In Michael Raymond DePaul (ed.), Resurrecting Old-Fashioned Foundationalism (pp. 21-38). Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • BonJour, L. 2003. “A Version of Internalist Foundationalism.” In Laurence BonJour and Ernest Sosa (eds.), Epistemic Justification: Internalism Vs. Externalism, Foundations Vs. Virtues (pp.5-96). Malden: Blackwell.
  • Brewer, B. 2011. Perception and its Objects. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, D. 1996. The Conscious Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, D. 2003. “The Content and Epistemology of Phenomenal Belief.” In Quentin Smith and Aleksandar Jokic (eds.), Consciousness: New Philosophical Perspectives (pp. 220-272). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, D. 2004. “Phenomenal Concepts and the Knowledge Argument.” In Peter Ludlow, Yujin Nagasawa, and Daniel Stoljar (eds.), There’s Something about Mary: Essays on Phenomenal Consciousness and Frank Jackson’s Knowledge Argument (pp. 269-298). Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Chalmers, D. 2007. “Phenomenal Concepts and the Explanatory Gap.” In Torin Alter and Sven Walter (eds.), Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism (pp. 167-194). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chisholm, R. 1942. “The Problem of the Speckled Hen.” Mind 51, 368-373.
  • Conee, E. 1994. “Phenomenal Knowledge.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 72, 136-150.
  • Davidson, D. 1986. “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge.” In Ernest Lepore (ed.), Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson (pp. 423-438). Malden: Blackwell.
  • Fales, E. 1996. A Defense of the Given. Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Feldman, R. 2004. “The Justification of Introspective Beliefs.” In Earl Conee and Richard Feldman (eds.), Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology (pp. 199-218). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fumerton, R. 1995. Metaepistemology and Skepticism. Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Fumerton, R. 2005. “Speckled Hens and Objections of Acquaintance.” Philosophical Perspectives 19, 121-138.
  • Gertler, B. 1999. “A Defense of the Knowledge Argument.” Philosophical Studies 93, 317-336.
  • Gertler, B. 2001. “Introspecting Phenomenal States.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 63, 305–328.
  • Gertler, B. 2011. Self-Knowledge. New York: Routledge.
  • Gertler, B. 2012. “Renewed Acquaintance.” In Declan Smithies and Daniel Stoljar (eds.), Introspection and Consciousness (pp. 93-128). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hasan, A. Forthcoming. “Phenomenal Conservatism, Classical Foundationalism, and Internalist Justification.” Philosophical Studies.
  • Jackson, F. 1982. “Epiphenomenal Qualia.” Philosophical Quarterly 32, 126-136.
  • Jackson, F. 1986. “What Mary Didn’t Know.” The Journal of Philosophy 83, 291-295.
  • Markie, P. 2009. “Classical Foundationalism and Speckled Hens.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 79, 190-206.
  • McGrew, T. 1995. The Foundations of Knowledge. Lanham: Littlefield Adams.
  • Nida-Rümelin, M. 1995. “What Mary Couldn’t Know: Belief about Phenomenal States.” In Thomas Metzinger (ed.), Conscious Experience (pp. 219-241). Exeter: Imprint Academic.
  • Pitt, D. “The Phenomenology of Cognition, or, What it is Like to Think That P?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 69, 1-36.
  • Poston, T. 2007. “Acquaintance and the Problem of the Speckled Hen.” Philosophical Studies 132, 331-346.
  • Poston, T. 2010. “Similarity and Acquaintance.” Philosophical Studies 147, 369-378.
  • Russell, B. 1905. “On Denoting.” Mind 14, 479-493.
  • Russell, B. 1910. “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 11, 108-128.
  • Russell, B. 1997 [1912]. Problems of Philosophy, ed. John Perry. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Russell, B. 1993 [1914]. Our Knowledge of the External World. New York: Routledge.
  • Sellars, W. 1963. Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind. In Science, Perception, and Reality. London: Routledge and Keagan Paul.
  • Sosa, E. 2003a. “Privileged Access.” In Quentin Smith and Aleksandar Jokic (eds.), Consciousness: New Philosophical Perspectives (pp. 273-292). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sosa, E. 2003b. “Beyond Internal Foundations to External Virtues.” In Laurence BonJour and Ernest Sosa (eds.), Epistemic Justification: Internalism Vs. Exeternalism, Foundations Vs. Virtues (pp. 99-170). Malden: Blackwell.
  • Tye, M. 2009. Consciousness Revisited. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Williams, M. 1999 [1977]. Groundless Belief. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

 

Author Information

John M. DePoe
Email: jdepoe@marywood.edu
Marywood University
U. S. A.

Knowledge

Philosophy’s history of reflection upon knowledge is a history of theses and theories; but no less of questions, concepts, distinctions, syntheses, and taxonomies. All of these will appear in this article. They generate, colour, and refine these philosophical theses and theories about knowledge. The results are epistemological — philosophical attempts to understand whatever is most fundamentally understandable about the nature and availability of knowledge. We will gain a sense of what philosophers have thought knowledge is and might be, along with why some philosophers have thought knowledge both does not and could not exist.

Thus, we will examine some of the general kinds or forms of knowledge that epistemologists have thought it important to highlight (section 1), followed by the idea of knowledge as a kind or phenomenon at all (section 2). Knowledge seems to be something we gain as we live; how do we gain it, though? That will be our next question (section 3), before we ask whether our apparently gaining knowledge is an illusion: might no one ever really gain knowledge (section 4)? Answers to these questions could reflect finer details of knowledge’s constituents (section 5), including the standards involved in knowing (section 6). The article ends by asking about the fundamental point of having knowledge (section 7).

Table of Contents

  1. Kinds of Knowledge
    1. Knowing by Acquaintance
    2. Knowledge-That
    3. Knowledge-Wh
    4. Knowing-How
  2. Knowledge as a Kind
  3. Ways of Knowing
    1. Innate Knowledge
    2. Observational Knowledge
    3. Knowing Purely by Thinking
  4. Knowing by Thinking-Plus-Observing
  5. Sceptical Doubts about Knowing
  6. Understanding Knowledge?
    1. The Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge
    2. Not the Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge?
    3. Questioning the Gettier Problem
  7. Standards for Knowing
    1. Certainty or Infallibility
    2. Fallibility
    3. Grades of Fallibility
    4. Safety and Lucky Knowing
    5. Mere True Belief
    6. Non-Factive Conceptions
  8. Knowing’s Point
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Kinds of Knowledge

We talk of knowledge: all of us do; philosophers do. But what is knowledge? We can best answer that potentially complex question in several stages. Let us begin by considering whether there are different kinds of knowledge. Epistemologists have contemplated at least the following general possibilities.

a. Knowing by Acquaintance

Your knowing a person, it seems, involves direct interaction with him or her. Otherwise, at most, you should claim only that it is almost as if you know him or her: ‘I’ve seen and heard so much about her that I feel like I know her. I wonder whether I’ll ever meet her — whether I will ever actually know her.’ Without that meeting, you could well know facts about the person (this being a kind of knowledge to be discussed in section 1.b). Nonetheless, could you know facts about a person without ever meeting him or her? If so, there could well be a kind of knowledge which is different to knowing a fact; maybe knowing a thing or entity (such as a person) is distinct from knowing a fact about that thing or entity.

Bertrand Russell (1959 [1912]: ch. 5) famously distinguished between knowledge by description and a quite particular kind of knowledge by acquaintance. He allowed there to be a form of acquaintance that was immediate and unquestionable, linking one with such things as abstract properties and momentary sensory items passing before one’s mind: you can be acquainted with the abstract property of redness, as well as with a specific patch of redness briefly in your visual field. Knowledge by description was the means by which, in Russell’s view, a person could proceed to know about what he or she had not experienced directly. We formulate definite descriptions (‘the third man listed in the current Sydney residential phonebook’) and indefinite ones (‘a man listed in the current Sydney residential phonebook’). With these, we can designate individuals with whom we have not interacted. Then we can formulate claims using such descriptions. Some of these claims could be knowledge. Thus, we may open up for ourselves a world of knowledge beyond what is revealed by our immediate experiences.

b. Knowledge-That

Most philosophical discussion of knowledge is directed at knowledge-that — such as knowledge that kangaroos hop, knowledge that koalas sleep most of the time, knowledge that kookaburras cackle, and the like. This is generally called propositional knowledge (a proposition that such-and-such is so is the object of the knowledge), declarative knowledge (the knowledge’s object is represented by a declarative sentence: ‘Such-and-such is so’), or knowledge-that (the knowledge is represented in the form ‘that such-and-such is so’). Knowledge by description (mentioned in section 1.a) would be one form that could be taken by knowledge-that: some known propositions include descriptions; but not all do. In principle, knowledge-that is the kind of knowledge present whenever there is knowledge of a fact or truth — no matter what type of fact or truth is involved: knowledge that 2 + 2 = 4; knowledge that rape is cruel; knowledge that there is gravity; and so on. When philosophers use the term ‘know’ unqualifiedly, knowledge-that is standardly what they mean to be designating. (It will therefore be the intended sense throughout most of this article.)

c. Knowledge-Wh

But should knowledge-that receive such sustained and uninterrupted focus by philosophers? After all, there is a far wider range of ways in which we talk and think, using the term ‘know’. Here are some of them (collectively referred to as knowledge-wh):

knowing whether it is 2 p.m.; knowing who is due to visit; knowing why a visit is needed; knowing what the visit is meant to accomplish; knowing how that outcome is best accomplished; and so forth.

How should these be understood? The usual view among epistemologists is that these are specific sorts of knowledge-that. For example, knowing whether it is 2 p.m. is knowing that it is 2 p.m., if it is; and knowing that it is not 2 p.m., if it is not. Knowing who is due to visit is knowing, for some specified person, that it is he or she who is due to visit. Knowing what the visit is meant to accomplish is knowing, for some specified outcome, that it is what the visit is meant to accomplish. Knowing how that outcome is best accomplished is knowing, for some specified description of how that outcome could be accomplished, that this describes the best way of accomplishing that outcome. And so on.

Still, not everyone will assess these examples in quite that way. Note a variation on this theme that is currently being developed. Called contrastivism, its basic idea is that (perhaps always; at least sometimes) to know is to know this rather than that. (For different versions, see Schaffer 2005; 2007; Morton 2011.) One’s knowing, understood contrastively, is explicitly one’s knowing one from among some understood or presumed bunch of possible alternatives. The word ‘explicitly’ is used here because one would know while acknowledging those alternatives. Consider the example of knowing-who. On contrastivism, you could know that it is Fred rather than Arjuna and Diego who is due to visit; and this might be the only way in which you know that Fred is due. ‘Who is due?’ ‘Fred, as against Arjuna or Diego.’ Your knowing-who would not be simply your knowing, of Fred, that it is he who is due to visit. Your knowing-who would be your knowing that it is Fred as against Arjuna or Diego who is due to visit. This remains propositional knowledge, nonetheless.

d. Knowing-How

Gilbert Ryle (1971 [1946]; 1949) made apparent to other philosophers the potential importance of distinguishing knowledge-that from knowledge-how. The latter is not (thought Ryle) one’s knowing how it is that something is so; this, we noted in section 1.c, is quite likely a form of knowledge-that. What Ryle meant by ‘knowing how’ was one’s knowing how to do something: knowing how to read the time on a clock, knowing how to call a friend, knowing how to cook a particular meal, and so forth. These seem to be skills or at least abilities. Are they not simply another form of knowledge-that? Ryle argued for their distinctness from knowledge-that; and often knowledge-how is termed ‘practical knowledge’. Is one’s knowing how to cook a particular meal really only one’s knowing a lot of truths — having much knowledge-that — bearing upon ingredients, combinations, timing, and the like? If Ryle was right, knowing-how is somehow distinct: even if it involves having relevant knowledge-that, it is also something more — so that what makes it knowledge-how need not be knowledge-that. [For more on this issue, see, for example, Bengson and Moffett 2012). Might knowledge-that even be a kind of knowledge-how itself, so that all instances of knowledge-that themselves are skills or abilities (for example, Hetherington 2011a: ch. 2)?]

2. Knowledge as a Kind

Section 1 shows how there might be different kinds of knowledge. We will now focus on one of them — knowledge-that. What kind of thing is such knowledge? In particular, is it a natural kind — a naturally occurring element in the scientifically describable world? Alternatively, is knowledge at least partly a conventional or artifactual kind — a part of our practices of judging and evaluating, possessing a socially describable nature?

The former idea portrays knowledge as an identifiable and explanatory aspect of what it is for beings relevantly like us to function as a natural component of a natural world. We have beliefs, some of which help us to achieve our aims by telling us how not to ‘bump into’ the world around us. We can ‘fit into’ — by ‘finding our way within’ — the world by using beliefs. Is that because these beliefs are knowledge? Is that part of why humans as a natural kind (if this is what we are) have prospered so markedly? In introducing epistemologists to the idea of what he called a naturalized epistemology, W. V. Quine (1969) recommended that philosophy conceive of us in psychological terms, so that when it seeks to understand us as reasoning, as believing, and as rational, it does not do this in terms distinct from those scientific ways of describing our psychological and physical features. Hilary Kornblith (2002) continues that theme: in effect, we know as other animals do — limitedly but reliably, thanks to our roles as sensing and believing beings operating within the world’s natural order. There would be natural laws, say, or at least natural regularities — scientifically formulable ones, we may hope — about how we know.

In contrast, we may feel that knowing is a distinctively conventional accomplishment. It might consist of socially constituted and approved patterns — not thereby natural laws or regularities admitting of scientific description — in aspects of how we interact with other people. Perhaps we can collectively choose what to count as knowledge. Perhaps that is all there is to knowing. Such a view could even say that this is how knowledge differs from belief: beliefs happen to or within us; knowledge we shape from beliefs. And we might do this deliberatively, subjecting ourselves and others to social norms of inquiry, responding to other people and their concepts, aims, and values. As civilizations expand and mutate, could knowing change not only its content (that is, what is known), but its basic nature (for example, how the knowing occurs and even what in general is required for it to occur)? Different social arrangements would bring into being different ways of thinking and acting, new aims and values. In that sense, possibly knowledge is an artefact, created by us in social groupings, used by us in those same groupings — often wittingly and deliberately so. In short, maybe knowing is a matter of functioning in socially apt ways. Barry Allen (2004) is one who argues for an artifactual interpretation of knowing’s nature.

The rest of this article will remain neutral between these two broad ideas. Some of the suggestions to be considered will be more appropriate (and clearly so) for one than the other of the two. But in general the article’s aim will be to display, not to favour.

3. Ways of Knowing

To say the least, not everyone knows everything, not even everything that in principle is knowable. Individual instances of knowledge come to individual people at individual times, remaining in place for varying — individual — lengths of time. So it is right to ask how it is that individual cases of knowledge reach, or are acquired by, people; along with how it is that these cases of knowledge are then retained by people. In what broadly characterisable ways do people gain and maintain their knowledge? In practice, philosophers do not treat that as a question about the ineliminable specificities of each person, each moment, and each particular piece of knowledge. It is treated as a question about general ways and means of coming to know a specific fact or truth.

Over the centuries, these have been some of the more philosophically pondered forms of answer to that question:

  • Some or all knowledge is innate. (And then it is remembered later, during life.)
  • Some or all knowledge is observational.
  • Some or all knowledge is non-observational, attained by thought alone.
  • Some or all knowledge is partly observational and partly not — attained at once by observing and thinking.

The rest of this section will consider these in turn.

a. Innate Knowledge

If some instances of knowledge accompany a person into life, how will they reveal themselves within his or her life? How would the person, or indeed anyone else, know that he or she has this innate knowledge? It could depend on what is being known innately — the subject matter of this knowledge with which the person has been born.

For example, if people begin life already knowing some grammatical rules (an idea famously due to Noam Chomsky: see Stich 1975, ch. 4), this innate knowledge would be shown in subsequent speedy, widespread, and reliable language-learning by those involved. These instances of people learning so readily and predictably would be actions expressing some knowledge-how. But (as section 1.d acknowledged) such manifestations of knowledge-how might actually reflect the presence within of knowledge-that.

Or consider another possible example: knowledge of some mathematics and some logical principles. Seemingly, Plato (in the Meno, one of his dialogues) accorded people this sort of innate knowledge; as did Leibniz, in his New Essays. (For excerpts from Plato and from Leibniz, see Stich 1975, ch. 2.) Plato presented us with a story of a slaveboy, lacking education, whom Socrates brought, via minimal questioning, to a state of remembering some geometrical knowledge.

Naturally, it could be difficult to ascertain that any particular knowledge is genuinely innate. Knowledge which is not innate, but which is acquired especially easily, seemingly effortlessly, might nonetheless feel innate. And (as section 1.d also acknowledged) even when an action, such as of language-learning, is manifesting knowledge-how, there remains a philosophical question as to whether that action is reflecting knowledge-that already existing within, dormant until activated. The answer to that question might be that there is only knowledge-how present — without owing its existence to some related prior knowledge-that. (As ever throughout this article these possibilities are suggested for continued consideration, not as manifestly decisive refutations.)

b. Observational Knowledge

One of epistemology’s perennially central topics has been that of observational knowledge. Let us consider a few of the vast number of philosophical questions that have arisen about such knowledge.

Can there be purely or directly observational knowledge? When you observe a cat sleeping in front of you, do you know observationally — and only observationally — that the cat is sleeping there? Observation is occurring; and you do not consciously ‘construct’ the knowledge. Still, is there a perceptual experience present, along with some conceptual or even theoretical knowledge (for example, that cats are thus-and-so, that to sleep is to do this-and-not-that, and so forth)? Otherwise, how could your experience constitute your knowing this-content-rather-than-another? Is conceptual knowledge what gives knowledgeable content to your observational experience? Is this so, even for experiences that are as simple as you can imagine having?

Can there be foundational observational knowledge? Wilfrid Sellars (1963) engaged famously with this question, confronting what he called the myth of the given. Part of the traditional epistemological appeal of the idea of there being purely or directly observational knowledge was the idea that such knowledge could be foundational knowledge. It would be knowledge given to us in experiences which would be cases of knowledge, yet which would be conceptually simple. Sellars argued, however, that they would not be conceptually so simple.

For example, imagine knowing observationally that here is something white. This would possibly be as simple, in conceptual terms, as observational knowledge could be for you. Nevertheless, even here the question remains of whether you are applying concepts (such as of being here, of being something, and of being white); and if you are doing so, of whether you must be able to know that you are using them correctly. Would you need to find even simpler observational experiences, via which you could know what these concepts involve? If so, the other experience — knowing observationally that here is something white — would not have been foundational. That is, it would not have amounted to a basic piece of knowledge, upon which other pieces of knowledge can be based and which need not itself be based upon other pieces of knowledge.

How much observation is needed for observational knowledge? When you look at what appears to be a cat, for how long must you maintain your gaze if you are to know that you are seeing a cat? Do you need also to walk around it, still looking at it, scrutinising it from different angles, if you are to know that you are seeing a cat? And what of your other senses? Could the animal’s sounding or smelling like a cat, for example, be needed if the knowledge in question is to be yours? There is a more general question behind those ones: What standard must observational knowledge meet? You are using, it seems, observational evidence; what standard must it meet, if it is to be giving you observational knowledge? (And that sort of question will arise about all evidence and all knowledge. That will become apparent as this article proceeds.)

[For a range of readings on observational knowledge, see Dancy 1988.]

c. Knowing Purely by Thinking

When philosophers ask about the possibility of some knowledge’s being gained purely by thinking — by reflection rather than observation —  they are wondering whether a priori knowledge is possible. Historically, those who believe that some such knowledge is possible are called rationalists about knowledge. (Empiricists, in contrast, believe that all knowledge is observational in its underlying nature, even when it might not seem so. This is the belief that all knowledge is a posteriori — present only after some suitably supportive observations are made.) As was done for observational knowledge in section 3.b, this section mentions a few of the multitude of questions that have arisen about a priori knowledge — knowledge which would be present, if it ever is, purely by thinking, maybe through an accompanying rational insight.

How would there be a priori knowledge? It is difficult, to say the least, for us ever to know that a piece of putative knowledge would not be at all observational, so that it would be gained purely by thought or reflection. We talk of pure mathematics, for example, and our knowledge of it. Consider the content of the sentence, ‘2 + 2 = 4.’ It could be applied to physical objects; nonetheless, we might deny that it is at all about such objects. But then we must explain how we know that we are using thought alone in knowing that 2 + 2 = 4, rather than knowing this mathematical truth in a way which is simply much less directly observational. Would we know it, for instance, partly by knowing how to interpret various physical representations which we would observe — numerals (‘2’ and ‘4’) and function signs (‘+’ and ‘=’)? If this is even part of how we know that 2 + 2 = 4, is the knowledge at least not purely a result of thought rather than observation?

[On related issues, see Quine’s ‘Two Dogmas of Empiricism’, in Moser 1987, a collection with many readings relevant to this section.]

Could a priori knowledge be substantive? It might be thought that pure reflection — and hence a priori knowledge — is possible when the truths being known are especially simple, even trivial. ‘All bachelors are unmarried’ is true, yet trivial: it is uninformative for anyone who understands at all the concept of a bachelor. ‘There is more than one infinity’ is true yet not trivial: it is informative for some who understand at all the concept of an infinitude. If ‘There is more than one infinity’ is knowable by thought alone, that would be substantive a priori knowledge. But if only truths like ‘All bachelors are unmarried’ are knowable purely by thinking, maybe there cannot be substantive a priori knowledge. So, which is it to be? (If we reply that it depends upon what a particular a priori known truth is about, we return to the previous paragraph’s question about knowledge gained purely by thinking. Alternatively, if we reply that it depends upon which standard is being met — such as when understanding a specific concept like that of bachelorhood or of infinitude, so as to gain knowledge from it — this takes us to the next paragraph’s question.)

[Classically, the issue of whether there can be substantive a priori knowledge was posed by Immanuel Kant, in his eighteenth-century Critique of Pure Reason (2007 [1781/1787] — as the question of whether there can be synthetic a priori knowledge.]

What standard would a priori knowledge have to satisfy? If there could be a priori knowledge, is it clear what standard it would need to have satisfied? There have long been philosophers for whom part of the appeal in the idea of a priori knowledge is the presumption that it would be infallible. That is, it would satisfy a conclusive — in effect, a perfect — evidential standard. It would do this because a capacity for pure thought, undistracted by observed contingencies within this world, would be what has provided the a priori knowledge. However, some recent epistemologists (for example, BonJour 1998) regard that picture as overly optimistic. The one person is both observing and thinking; and if we expect fallibility to be part of how she observes, maybe we should expect fallibility likewise when she is thinking. Is it simply obvious that when we are not observing, only thinking, we are more — let alone perfectly — reliable or trustworthy in our views? Or do we also think only imperfectly? Perhaps we need observations as ‘checks’ on what could otherwise become thoughts ‘floating free’ in our minds. Yet maybe, even so, these ‘checks’ remain imperfect. To think without observing might not be to improve dramatically, if at all, the use of one’s mind.

d. Knowing by Thinking-Plus-Observing

And so again we meet the question of the extent to which, in one way or another, we are vulnerable when trying to gain whatever knowledge we can. Of course, we might claim that we are only vulnerable when focussing just on observation or on reflection — ignoring the other. Surely (it will be suggested), much or even all of our knowledge is a mixture — both observational and reasoned. Is that how we will stride forward as knowers?

Optimism replies, ‘Yes. Possibly there are philosophical limits upon the effectiveness of observation by itself and of reason by itself. Still, to combine them is to overcome those limits, or at least enough of them.’ In response to which, less-than-optimism counsels, ‘Maybe not. If each of observation and reflection has limitations of its own, a combination of them might compound those weaknesses. The result could be a blurring of the two, so that we would never know whether, on a particular occasion, weakness in one — in the observing or in the reflecting — is weakening the whole.’ Which of those alternatives is right? Optimism? Less-than-optimism?

That depends. We should now consider an epistemologically classic doubt about people’s abilities ever to gain knowledge.

4. Sceptical Doubts about Knowing

From the outset of philosophical thinking about knowledge, doubts have never been far away: do we really know what we think we know? And that question was not meant merely to ask whether sometimes we are mistaken in claiming a particular piece of knowledge. The philosophical concern was more pressing: do we ever know what we think we know? Even when lacking all views on whether we know, could we always fail to know? Is knowledge an attainment forever beyond us — all of us, everyone, all of the time?

That question confronts us with a radical sceptical possibility. Possibilities that are less radical but still possibly disturbing, and less widely sceptical but still sceptical, have also been discussed. Is there no knowledge of a physical world? Is there no scientific knowledge? Is there no knowledge of moral truths? Is there no knowledge of the future? And so it goes. Let us now examine one of these. It is one of philosophy’s most famous non-radical sceptical arguments — a scepticism about external world knowledge. (It is sceptical, partly because it denies something otherwise accepted by almost everyone: sceptical denials are surprising in that sense.) Here is how it unfolds.

If there is observational knowledge (section 3.b), it is knowledge of what philosophers generally call the external world. By this, they mean to designate the physical world, regarded as something with an existence and nature distinct from (and perhaps, or perhaps not, represented accurately in) any individual’s beliefs as to its existence and nature. Those beliefs could be true because there is a physical world with a nature matching what the beliefs attribute to it. Equally, however, the beliefs could be false because there is no physical world quite, or even at all, as the beliefs claim it to be. And if the beliefs are false, the usual philosophical moral to be drawn would be that they are not knowledge. (Knowledge is only of truths or facts: see section 6.f.)

Still, do we ever have reason to regard all of our beliefs about the physical world as actually false? Perhaps not consciously so, while ever in fact we have the beliefs; for part of having a belief is some sort of acceptance of its content as true, not false. Nevertheless, maybe one can have a belief while accepting that one cannot know quite how one has gained that belief. And this is significant because there are ways of having a belief which — even without guaranteeing the belief’s being false — would be incompatible with the belief’s being knowledge. For instance, even if one feels as though a particular belief has been formed via careful reasoning, perhaps ultimately that belief is present largely because one wants it to be. And one might concede this, even if reluctantly, as a possibility about oneself. More generally, therefore, maybe one could have a belief while also accepting one’s not quite being able to know that one has not gained it in a way which is wholly unsuitable for its being knowledge.

In theory, there are many possible knowledge-precluding ways of gaining a particular belief. Here are a few generically described ways:

  • Sometimes, your individual sensing or thinking might be only yours, in the worrying sense that it could be misleading on the particular topic of your belief, more so than other people’s sensing or thinking would be on that same topic.
  • Sometimes, anyone’s sensing is only human, in the sense that it could be misleading about aspects of the world which other animals sense more accurately.
  • Human reasoning is also only ever human in the sense that (as Christopher Cherniak has explained: 1986) even some seemingly simple assessments could be computationally beyond our capacities. There is only so much that any person’s brain can do with so much data. Even checking for something as familiar as consistency between many of one’s beliefs is an extremely complex task. This is not necessarily because consistency in itself is always complex. It is because there is too much checking to do, given the need to evaluate every possible combination from among one’s beliefs.

Sceptical arguments could be generated from those and from comparable possibilities.

One historically prominent suggestion — philosophers usually attribute its most influential form to Descartes (1911 [1641]), in his ‘Meditation I’ — directs us to the phenomenon of dreaming. Suppose that you feel as though you are sensing, in a normal way, a cat’s sitting in front of you. But suppose that this experience is actually present as part of your dreaming, not as part of using your senses in a normal way. There seems to you to be a cat; the circumstance feels normal to you; even so, in fact you are asleep, dreaming. Presumably, therefore, your feeling or experience at this time is not providing you with knowledge right now of the cat’s presence.

Now, could that be how it is on every occasion of your feeling there to be a cat in front of you? Indeed, we can generalise that question, to this philosophical challenge: Whenever you seem to be having a sensory experience about the world around you, can you know that you are not dreaming at that time? And this question is a challenge, not only a question, because it might not be clear how you could have that knowledge of not dreaming at that time. Any evidence you mention in support of the contention that you are not dreaming will be the same sort of evidence as that which has just been questioned. Imagine thinking to yourself, ‘I remember waking up this morning. I feel awake still. I feel so awake.’ You thereby feel as though you are mentioning some good evidence, reflecting decisive non-dreaming experiences. But your having that feeling could itself be present as part of your dreaming; and if it is, then it is not knowledge. So, any such experience on your part of reaching for apparently good evidence, of bringing to mind how awake you feel, will merely be more of the same. That is, it will be just another instance of the same sort of experience as was being questioned in the first place; and it will be no less vulnerable to the possibility of merely being part of a more or less extended moment of dreaming by you. Your citing these further experiences thus provides no new form of evidence which is somehow above suspicion in this context of questioning the apparently observational evidence (the suspicion, remember, of possibly being an experience produced as part of a dreaming experience).

Then the sceptical conclusion follows swiftly. If you never know that your apparent experiences of the physical world around you are not present as part of your dreaming while asleep, you never know that what feels to you like a normally produced belief about the world is not present as part of an experience which precludes that you are thereby having a belief at this time which is knowledge. Accordingly, for all that you do know about yourself at that time, you fail to have knowledge of your surroundings. In that sense, you might not have knowledge of the physical world around you. Do your apparent beliefs about the world fail in that way to be knowledge? Indeed so, concludes the sceptical reasoning: if (for all that you do otherwise know about them) they might not be knowledge, then they are not sufficiently well supported by you to actually be knowledge.

[On external world scepticism in particular, see Stroud (1984: ch. 1). On scepticism and dreaming, see Sosa (2007: ch. 1). On sceptical reasoning in general, see DeRose and Warfield 1999.]

5. Understanding Knowledge?

There are various possible ways of seeking philosophical understanding of a phenomenon. One such approach involves attempting to understand the phenomenon in terms of other phenomena. If one can do this exhaustively and with full precision, one might even attain a definition of the phenomenon. Sometimes that method is called the search for an analytic reduction of the phenomenon in question. (It is also often described as analysing the concept of that phenomenon. But the associated aim should thereby be to understand the phenomenon itself: hopefully, we would understand X by having a full and precise understanding of what it takes for something to satisfy the concept of X.) That approach has dominated epistemology’s efforts over the past fifty or so years to understand knowledge’s nature.

a. The Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge

In 1963, a short paper was published which highlighted — while questioning strikingly — a way of trying to define knowledge. Section 5.b will present the question raised by that paper. Right now, we should have before us a sense of what it questioned — which was a kind of view that has generally been called the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge.

That conception was usually presented as a definition. The thinking behind it took this form:

Consider someone’s knowing that such-and-such is the case. This instance of knowing amounts, by definition, to the person’s having a true and well justified belief that such-and-such is the case.

So, three distinct phenomena are identified (even if only in a generic way), before being combined. And that combination is being said to be what any — and only any — case of knowledge exemplifies. Knowledge is a belief; but not just any belief. Knowledge is always a true belief; but not just any true belief. (A confident although hopelessly uninformed belief as to which horse will win — or even has won — a particular race is not knowledge, even if the belief is true.) Knowledge is always a well justified true belief — any well justified true belief. (And thus we have the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge.)

What does ‘justified’ mean? That is a substantial topic in its own right, but it is not the topic of this article. Still (for illustration only), here are two possible forms that justification can take within knowledge:

Evidence. Often, you have evidence — supportive experiences and views, consciously held — which, overall, favours your belief that such-and-such is the case. This evidence is thereby justification for or towards your belief’s being true. (On justification as evidence, see Conee and Feldman 2004.)

Reliability. Often, you have formed your belief that such-and-such is the case in a way which was likely to have led you to form a true belief. This reliability is thereby justification for or towards your belief’s being true. (On reliability as justification, see Goldman 1979.)

Must such justification — be it favourable evidence or be it reliability in belief-formation — be perfect support for or towards the belief’s being true? Section 6.a will discuss that idea; the usual answer is ‘No, perfection is not needed.’ At the very least, that answer was part of the underpinning to the famous 1963 questioning of the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge.

[Epistemology textbooks standardly present some version of a justified-true-belief conception of knowledge: for example, Chisholm 1989; Hetherington 1996; Feldman 2003; Morton 2003; Zagzebski 2009.]

b. Not the Justified-True-Belief Conception of Knowledge?

Edmund Gettier’s 1963 article had a dramatic epistemological impact — as immediately so as is possible within philosophy. Almost all epistemologists, at the time and since, have agreed that Gettier disproved the justified-true-belief conception of knowledge. How so?

He proposed two supposed counterexamples to the claim that a belief’s being true and well justified is sufficient for its being knowledge. In each of his imagined cases, a person forms a belief which is true and well justified, yet which — this is the usual view, at any rate — is not knowledge. (These situations came to be known as Gettier cases, as did the many subsequent kindred cases.) For instance, in Gettier’s first case a person Smith forms a belief that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket. Smith’s evidence is that the company president told him that Jones would get the job, and that Smith has counted the coins in Jones’s pocket. Is Smith’s belief true? Yes, it is; but only because he himself will get the job and because he himself has ten coins in his pocket — two facts of which he is actually unaware.

Why is a belief like Smith’s not knowledge? Many theories have been proposed, as to why such beliefs (Gettiered beliefs, as they have come to be called) are not knowledge. Collectively, this post-Gettier theorising has generated another independently large epistemological topic — the Gettier problem. But none of those theories are favored here because epistemology as a whole has not favored one. There has been widespread agreement only on Gettier cases being situations from which knowledge is absent — not on why or how the knowledge is absent.

[For an extensive exposition of the first twenty years of epistemology’s engagement with the Gettier problem, including a range of theories that were proposed as to why Gettiered beliefs are not knowledge, see Shope 1983. For recent accounts, see Lycan 2006 and Hetherington 2011b.]

c. Questioning the Gettier Problem

A few forms of doubt have been advanced about the potency of Gettier’s challenge. Such doubts, if correct, could allow philosophers to return to a view — a pre-Gettier view — of knowledge as being some sort of justified true belief. Let's consider two of those forms of doubt.

A more varied range of intuitions is needed. In reacting to Gettier’s own two cases and to the many similar ones that have since appeared, epistemologists have continually relied on its being intuitively clear that the cases’ featured beliefs are not instances of knowledge. In response to case after case, epistemologists say that ‘intuitively’ the belief in question — the Gettiered belief — is not knowledge.

Yet that sort of reaction has begun to be questioned by some work that initiated what has since become known as experimental philosophy. Rather than continuing to rely only on what epistemologists and their students would say about such thought-experiments, Jonathan Weinberg, Shaun Nichols, and Stephen Stich (2001) asked a wider range of people for their intuitive reactions, including to some Gettier cases. This wider range included people not affiliated with universities or colleges, along with more people of a non-European ancestry. And the results were at odds with what epistemological orthodoxy would have expected. For example, interestingly more respondents of a Subcontinental ancestry (Indian, Pakistani, Bangladeshi) than ones of a Western European ancestry replied that the Gettiered beliefs about which they were being asked are instances of knowledge.

This does not prove that Gettiered beliefs are knowledge, of course. But it complicates the epistemological story: to whom — to whose intuitions, if to any — should we be listening here? Some philosophers are beginning to wonder whether such a result should even undermine their confidence in knowledge’s being something more than a justified true belief — in particular, its being a non-Gettiered justified true belief.

[For discussions of the nature and role of intuitions within philosophy, see DePaul and Ramsey 1998. On intuitions and epistemology, see Weinberg 2006.]

The need to be fallibilist in assessing the knowledge’s absence. Gettier introduced his challenge (section 5.b) as concerning precisely what knowledge is if its justification component is not required to be producing infallibly good support for or towards the belief’s being true. Section 6 will focus upon a range of possible standards that knowledge could be thought to need to meet. Fallibilism is one of them; for now, we need note only that it functions explicitly within Gettier’s challenge as a constraint upon knowledge.

For example, in Gettier’s first case Smith’s evidence (the company president’s testimony, and Smith’s counting the coins in Jones’s pocket) justifies only fallibly his final belief (that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket). By this, Gettier meant that the evidence does not logically mandate or entail the belief’s being true: the belief could have been false, even given that evidence’s being true. In fact, the belief is true. But how is it made true? It is made true, we saw, not by aspects of Jones, but by aspects of Smith himself — none of which are noticed by his evidence. Accordingly, the fallibility within the case amounts to a ‘gap’ of logic or information between the evidence-content’s being true and the final belief’s truth. This gap allows the case’s final belief to be true because of something other than what is reported in the evidence. And so that final belief is not knowledge.

Yet here is a counter-challenge (described more fully in Hetherington 2011c). When thinking that the case’s final belief is not knowledge, could epistemologists unwittingly have been applying a higher standard to the case than a fallibilist one? Is it possible that to deny Smith this knowledge is to assume, even if not deliberately, an infallibilist standard instead? It will not feel to an epistemologist as if this is happening. Yet could it be, even so? How would an epistemologist know that an infallibilist standard is not what is being applied, even if only implicitly and even if she is claiming explicitly to be applying a fallibilist standard? Ultimately, epistemologists have relied on appeals to intuition as a way of monitoring their more theoretical interpretations of Gettier cases. And (as we found a moment ago) there is a question about how decisive that is as a way of knowing exactly what epistemological moral to take from the cases.

Here is an alternative possible fallibilist interpretation of Gettier’s case about the job and the coins. Although there is a ‘gap’ of logic or information between what Smith’s evidence and reasoning claims to tell him about directly (that is, aspects of Jones) and how his final belief is made true (that is, by aspects of Smith himself), some such ‘gap’ is sometimes to be expected whenever a merely fallibilist standard for knowing is at stake. So (continues this interpretation), if the presence of a fallibilist standard was the only shortcoming in the case, we should not dismiss the belief as failing to be knowledge; for that would be simply an infallibilist dismissal of the belief.

We must acknowledge, however, that something more than mere fallibility is present within the case: only through some actual oddity does Smith’s true belief (the final belief) eventuate within the case. Hence, the question is one of whether that combination — the fallibility and the oddity — should be allowed by fallibilism as being knowledge nonetheless. Of course knowledge would rarely, even at most, be fallibly present in such an odd way; could it ever be, though? Normally it would not be; abnormally, however, could it be? So, could there be knowledge like this? Might a Gettiered belief be knowledge? Even if it is rare, is it possible?

Some epistemologists have argued that what such cases show is the need for the justification within a belief’s being knowledge somehow to guarantee the truth of the belief (for example, Zagzebski 1994). But we should ask whether this is evading rather than solving Gettier’s challenge. (Howard-Snyder, Howard-Snyder, and Feit argue that it is also not needed for solving Gettier’s challenge: 2003.) That question arises because Gettier is challenging only justified-true-belief conceptions of knowledge which include a fallibilist form of justification. Our correlative aim, if we accept the usual reading of Gettier cases, should be to formulate a satisfactory conception of that form of knowledge.

[On the nature of fallibilism, see Hetherington (2005) and Dougherty (2011).]

6. Standards for Knowing

Many philosophical questions about knowledge (its nature and availability) may be treated as questions about standards. We expect knowledge to amount to something, to be an improvement in some respect upon various forms of non-knowledge. (Why is that so? Section 7 will discuss what knowledge is for, hence why it should meet any particular standard.) Section 5 ended by asking about knowledge and infallibilism; we may now consider a wider range of possible standards, beginning with infallibility, which have at times been placed by epistemologists and others upon knowing.

a. Certainty or Infallibility

There is a recurring temptation, often felt by philosophers and non-philosophers alike, to impose some kind of infallibilist standard upon knowing. This can even feel intuitive to the person applying the standard. One version of that temptation talks of certainty — not necessarily a subjectively experienced sense of certainty, but what is usually termed an epistemic kind of certainty. The latter amounts to the certainty’s being a rationally inviolable and unimprovable form of justificatory support, regardless of whether it feels so perfect. (It could also be experienced as certainty. That would not be the important aspect of its being part of the knowing, though.)

Why would one adopt such a demanding view of knowledge? Perhaps because the alternative could feel too undemanding. Consider the apparent oddity of claims like this:

I do know that I’m looking at a dingo, even though I could be mistaken.

(One could talk in that way because one might implicitly be thinking, ‘My evidence isn’t perfect.’) Is that concessive knowledge-attribution, as it is often called, a contradiction? If it is, perhaps knowing is incompatible with possibly being mistaken; in which case, knowledge does have to involve an epistemic certainty. What epistemologists in general regard as the most famous advocacy of knowing’s including such certainty was by Descartes, again in his ‘Meditation I’ (1911 [1641]).

Of course, there remains the possibility that knowing is merely incompatible with saying or thinking that one is possibly mistaken — not with the fact of one’s possibly being mistaken. This is why the oddity of concessive knowledge-attributions might not entail knowledge’s including certainty or infallibility. The matter is currently being debated (for example, Dougherty and Rysiew 2009).

b. Fallibility

The spectre of a sceptical conclusion is the most obvious philosophical concern about requiring knowledge to satisfy an infallibilist standard. If knowledge is like that, then how often will anyone succeed in actually having some knowledge? Rarely, if ever (is the usual reply). For people’s imperfections in their attempts to know (see the examples highlighted early in section 4) will be incompatible with the success of those attempts — if perfection is required for such success. Anyone who accepts infallibilism about some or all knowledge must confront the question of whether he or she wants thereby to deny that any such knowledge is ever actually attained. (Descartes wished not to be a sceptic, for example, even as he allowed that some knowledge, if it was to be present, would have to be certain.)

So there is a key choice, between infallibility and fallibility, in what standard we are to require of knowing. To demand infallibility is to court the danger of scepticism. Again, though (as section 6.a acknowledged), settling for fallibility may seem overly accommodating of the possibility of mistake. This is a substantial choice to make in thinking philosophically about knowledge. Most epistemologists profess not to be infallibilists. They aim to understand knowing as needing only to satisfy a fallibilist standard. Think of everyday situations in which people attribute knowledge: ‘I know that you are a good person. And I know that you are sitting down.’ The knowledge being attributed is not being thought to involve infallibility. Nonetheless, we do claim or attribute knowledge casually yet literally, all day, every day. In practice, we are fallibilists in that respect. (Still, in practice we also often could have infallibilist moments: ‘You’re not sure? Then you don’t know.’ The situation is complex. Maybe we are not always consistent about this.)

c. Grades of Fallibility

What any fallibilist could helpfully do, therefore, is to ascertain which standard of fallibility is the minimum one that must be met by any instance of knowing. So far, the discussion has been about fallibility, not different standards of fallibility. But in theory the latter way of talking is available. After all, fallibility is merely an absence of infallibility; and there might be many possible standards available to be met, each of which would fall short to some or another extent of the absolute achievement constituted by infallibility. Consider three ideas that have been proposed.

Animal knowledge; reflective knowledge. Maybe we can distinguish between a kind of knowledge which involves some sort of reliability (see section 5.a above), and one which adds to that reliability an appropriately aware reflectiveness about that reliability. Sosa (2009) describes this as a distinction between animal knowledge and reflective knowledge; and he regards the latter as a better way of knowing a truth. In principle, each kind of knowledge can be fallible (although an infallibilist, such as Sosa himself, can also accept the distinction). What matters for the present discussion is that you could know a particular truth, such as that you are tired, in either an animal way or a reflective way. But your reflective knowledge of being tired will be a better grade than your animal knowledge of being tired. The reflectiveness would improve your epistemic relationship to the fact of your being tired. Nevertheless, that relationship would remain one of knowing. So the knowing would improve as knowledge of the particular fact of your being tired. You would know that fact less fallibly, by knowing it more reflectively.

Knowledge-gradualism. That talk of improving the knowing should be suggestive for a fallibilist. Maybe we can allow there to be many grades or degrees of fallibility — reflecting, for instance, the multiply varied extents to which evidence can support a belief well. Think of a body of observational data: your belief could receive improved support if the data proceeded to be supplemented by further corroborative observations. Similarly, think of hearing expert testimony — and then more of it, by even better experts — in support of a thesis. The idea of improving one’s evidence, or one’s reliability in attaining true beliefs, is perfectly compatible with already having good support for a particular belief. A belief could be more, or it could be less, fallibly supported — yet well supported all the while.

Then we might also say that the knowledge itself is improved. The belief would already be knowledge, with there being good enough justificatory support for it. But its quality as knowledge of the particular truth in question would correspond to the degree or grade of its fallibility, such as of the fallibility in its justification component. And this degree or grade could improve, as the fallibility is lessened by the improvement in the justificatory support. For example, you know better that it is raining, if you see that it is and you feel its doing so. You still know — but less well — that it is raining, if you only see that it is. In each case, your knowledge is fallible; it remains knowledge, though. [For more on this idea, see Hetherington (2001; 2011a). See Hetherington (2011a: sec. 2.7) on others who have accepted it.

Contextualism. In recent years, contextualism has attracted much philosophical attention, especially within epistemology (for example, Cohen 1986; 1991; DeRose 1999; 2009; Lewis 1996). It is a way of claiming to understand the truth-conditions of utterances or thoughts, particularly of knowledge-attributions or knowledge-denials. And it is often thought to accommodate the existence of different standards for knowledge-attributions. It has mainly focussed on this sort of comparison:

  • In an ‘everyday’ conversational context, when she is asked whether you know that dingoes exist, your friend may well say of you that you do.
  • In a conversational context where sceptical possibilities are being taken seriously, when she is asked that same question, your friend may well deny that you know that dingoes exist.

This disparity, according to contextualism, reflects different standards (or something similar) being applied within the respective contexts. A lower and more accommodating standard for applying the term ‘knows’ to you is presumed within the everyday context; not so in the sceptically-aware context.

Note that contextualism, as a kind of theory of knowledge-attributions or knowledge-denials, is not directly a kind of theory of knowing. It is a theory directly about language use and meaning (specifically, occasions of talking or thinking while using the word ‘knows’ and its cognates); in that sense, it is not directly about knowing as such. Contextualism is mentioned here because some epistemologists (for example, Stanley 2005) have thought that if we were to countenance there being different grades of (fallible) knowing, this is how we would have to do so. Such a thought is mistaken, though, even if we regard contextualism as indirectly a theory of knowing. For we have already met two approaches that are directly about knowing (animal/reflective knowledge, and knowledge-gradualism) while also accepting the possibility of there being different grades of fallible knowing.

d. Safety and Lucky Knowing

Even if we accept that knowledge can be fallible (section 6.b) and even if we accept that there can be different grades of (fallible) knowledge (section 6.c), we might still be concerned about the possibility of being too generous in according people knowledge. (The concern would be about the possibility of generosity’s triumphing over accuracy.) In particular, some epistemologists (for example, Prichard 2005) will insist that a moral to be learnt from the Gettier problem (section 5.b above) is that (fallible) knowledge is never present when some kinds of luck are involved in the presence of that true belief, given that justification. In this respect, can there be lucky knowledge — accurate and justified, but only luckily accurate (even given that justification)? Epistemologists usually deny that knowledge could be like that. Recently, their denial has tended to take the form of specifying that knowledge has to be safe — a condition failed, we are then told, by those beliefs found within Gettier cases:

Safety. A true belief is safely formed just in case, given how it has been formed, it would have been formed only if true.

But is that sort of condition really failed in Gettier cases? This depends on how we describe the way, within a given Gettier case, in which the final true belief has been formed. For example, it would be natural to say that in Gettier’s own first case (section 5.b above), Smith forms his belief — that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket — by listening to the company president and by counting coins in Jones’s pocket. Yet to form that belief on that basis is to proceed in a way that was likely to yield not only Smith’s same belief, but its being true. Hence, Safety does not obviously tell us why Smith’s belief — by being unsafely formed — is not knowledge.

Instead of Safety, therefore, what the epistemologically usual interpretation needs to require is something a little more complicated, along these lines:

Safety+. A true belief is safely formed just in case, given how it has been formed and given the surrounding circumstances in which it has been formed, it would have been formed only if true.

Does that show us why the usual interpretation of Gettier cases is correct? We should consider two possible answers to this question.

Yes, it does.’ The usual interpretation might say that Smith’s surrounding circumstances include the facts that he himself will get the job and that he himself has ten coins in his pocket — facts of which Smith is ignorant. He has formed his belief (that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket) on the basis only of evidence about Jones — none of which describes how Smith’s belief is in fact made true (by facts about Smith). And in general a belief is formed unsafely if it is formed by overlooking facts that make the belief true. Thus, given how Smith’s belief is formed, it was likely not to be formed as true. This explains why the belief is not knowledge.

No, it does not.’ We might say instead that, although Smith’s circumstances (which include the facts, overlooked by him, that he himself will get the job and that he himself has ten coins in his pocket) are odd, in fact they render even more likely his forming the same final belief along with the belief’s being true. After all, those circumstances now include the details constituting that final belief’s being true — the details of how it is true, details about Smith himself. So (on this alternative interpretation), Smith’s final belief is not formed unsafely. The belief’s failing to be knowledge (if it does fail to be) is therefore not explained by its being formed unsafely.

As the preceding two paragraphs show, competing interpretive possibilities exist here. It might be advisable, then, for us to be cautious about embracing the idea that an anti-luck condition like Safety or even Safety+ impels us towards the usual interpretation of Gettier cases. Those conditions might not reveal the impossibility of lucky knowledge, at least not on the basis of Gettier cases. [For debate on this, see Pritchard 2012 and Hetherington 2012.]

e. Mere True Belief

Section 5.a assumed that knowledge is at least a justified true belief. Gettier’s challenge, in section 5.b, was to knowledge’s never needing to be anything more than a justified true belief. But must knowledge be even as much as a justified true belief? In this section and the next, we will encounter a few epistemologically heterodox ways in which people have sometimes regarded knowledge, in principle at any rate, as able to be less than a justified true belief.

Here is one of those ways of drastically lowering the standard required for knowing:

Knowledge need not be anything beyond a true belief.

On that suggestion (for example, Sartwell 1991; 1992), justification — be it good evidence; be it good reliability; be it both or neither — is not needed as part of knowing. Accordingly, even when justification is in fact present and supporting a particular true belief, it was never needed for the mere presence of knowledge. This is because the belief, by being true, would be knowledge anyway, irrespectively of whether there was also justification supporting the truth of the belief. (What does the justification do in such a case? Even if it was not needed for the knowledge’s mere presence, could its presence improve the knowing? That is, could it strengthen the knowing’s grade? This would exemplify section 6.c’s idea of knowledge-gradualism.)

Might that be how knowledge is? Few epistemologists will accept so, although developed arguments against that picture are also few. The standard form of argument is an appeal to normality of linguistic usage, even intuitions: ‘Intuitively, knowledge is something more than only a true belief. Otherwise, every confident and lucky guess is knowledge!’ Is that sort of point decisive? Section 5.c raised the question of how much we should credit ourselves with having a faculty of intuitive insight into knowledge’s nature. Moreover, Alvin Goldman (1999) shows how, if we allow a weak sense of knowledge (whereby such knowledge is required only to be at least a true belief), we can still accommodate how people in many fields of inquiry and policy beyond philosophy purport to talk — apparently constructively, within those fields — of knowledge.

f. Non-Factive Conceptions

When people talk casually of knowledge, sometimes they reflect a non-factive conception of it. (Philosophers almost never talk in this way of knowledge, but at times others do.) Any non-factive conception of knowledge allows this idea:

Knowledge need not be even a true belief. (Even if it is always a belief or something related, truth is not essential for knowing.)

Here are two ways of expanding upon that idea.

Mere socially justified belief. Maybe being socially justified is enough to make a belief knowledge. That is, what most people within a particular social grouping would accept is thereby knowledge for that grouping; and knowledge would only ever be knowledge for some or another grouping, and in such a way.

Mere professionally justified belief. Some such social groupings are also professional groupings (for example, of physicists, of physicians, of high school teachers, of carpenters, and so forth). Within that kind of social grouping, being widely accepted is enough to make a belief knowledge.

Those proposals share the idea that nothing beyond acceptance within a designated group need be expected of a view if it is to be knowledge. Insisting on truth as an additional condition of the view’s being knowledge would be needless (according to these non-factive conceptions of knowledge), perhaps because any attempt within a group to ascertain whether the accepted view is true would itself need to be accepted within the group. Such acceptance would remain paramount in practice. (We might even want to say that truth is thereby being ascertained, precisely because truth is whatever is accepted widely by one’s fellow speakers and peers. For an influential instance of that pragmatist approach to conceiving of knowledge and truth, see Rorty 1979. But it is far from clear that many classical pragmatists would share that approach: see Bernstein 2010.)

Of course, we may also wonder whether those ways of talking of justification are too lenient in what they allow to be knowledge. The key question is that of whether a group could be not only mistaken in a shared belief, but even unreliable in how they form and try to support it. If so, could that belief actually be unjustified, no matter that the group’s members take it to be justified? This would be so, if justification is a kind of actual reliability (section 5.a) in being correct — reliability which even an entire group might therefore lack when sharing a particular belief.

Yet some people (even if probably no epistemologists) might wish to understand knowledge in an even more deflationary way. Here are two such approaches:

Mere sincere belief. Is it enough — for knowledge — that a person sincerely believes something to be so? Yes.

Mere sincere feeling. Is it enough — for knowledge — for a person to feel something to be so? Yes.

Suppose someone claims to have a specific piece of knowledge. Yet when asked for supporting evidence, she provides none. No matter; she claims anyway to have the knowledge: ‘I really do believe it. I sincerely feel it to be so. That’s enough for knowledge, isn’t it?’

Well, is it? Often the dictates merely of manners or friendliness dictate our not engaging critically with such claims of knowledge. So as to be polite, for example, you refrain from telling someone that his or her claim, made carefully to you, is insufficiently justified and hence is not knowledge. But epistemology professes to focus more upon accuracy and knowledge than cheeriness and decorum. Could you unwittingly be condescending or patronising, indeed, when forbearing to assess critically whether the other person really knows? To allow his or her mere claim or belief — simply because he or she feels it sincerely — to be knowledge is possibly to trivialise the notion of knowledge. Even if this is done with the intention of respecting the person (by not questioning him or her critically), the result could be to trivialise or somehow to lessen the status of the person in that setting. This is because the person would not be being treated as someone whom there is even a point in subjecting to a higher standard (such as of being genuinely justified or definitely correct). Think of how proper it could be to adopt this undemanding approach if the person was a child, or was otherwise mentally incapable of appreciating and striving to meet the higher standard. Equally, therefore, think of how improper it would be to do this if the person is not incapable of such an aim and effort — such as if he or she is a cognitively capable adult.

7. Knowing’s Point

With those reflections, we reach the question of what knowing is for. If we are to understand what knowledge is (what kind of thing it is; what its components or features are), along with whether and how it is available to us, we should reflect upon what role knowing would play within the lives of knowers. One way of doing so is to confront the question of what value there is in knowing — its inherent value, if there is any. Jonathan Kvanvig (2003) calls this the value problem within epistemology.

That issue first appeared in Plato’s Meno, as the question of how knowledge is more valuable than merely true belief. How is it more valuable, if it is, for you to know that you are hungry than merely to believe accurately that you are hungry? That question is not intended to be only or even about subjective value, such as about how grateful or pleased you may be, in a given case, to have knowledge rather than something lesser. The question concerns whatever value knowing has for a person, even if he or she does not realise that the value is present. Briefly consider a few possible ways of trying to answer that question.

Virtue epistemology. We might regard knowing as a person’s having manifested various virtues of an intellectual nature. These could be more, or they could be less, narrowly characterised. For example, an intellectual virtue may involve a cognitive faculty that is intellectually reliable (this phenomenon was mentioned in section 5.a); or, less narrowly, an intellectual virtue can reflect more of one’s being generally solicitous and respectful towards truth. And one’s manifesting such virtues would be a personal achievement. It would reflect well in general, to some non-trivial extent, upon one as an inquirer. In this sense, knowing could be an inherent part of personal development. In knowing, is one better as a person (all else being equal)? [For instances of this way of thinking, see Zagzebski 1996; Sosa 2007; Greco 2010.]

Reliable informants. Anyone with knowledge is potentially helpful to others, by being — inherently so — a reliable source of information. In a similar but restricted way, so too is a thermometer (Armstrong 1973: ch. 12); and, realising this, we create thermometers expressly for that purpose. Do we regard knowers analogously, primarily as reliable repositories of information for others? And do we create knowers likewise, when interpreting people as knowers? See section 2 above for the idea of knowledge as an artefact, created socially to serve conventionally significant purposes. In this sense, is knowing an inherent part of how people function socially? And is that valuable in itself? [On the idea of knowers as reliable informants, see Craig 1990. On knowing via testimony, see Coady 1992 and Lackey 2008.]

Usefulness. Knowledge can be used in various ways, some of which could well contribute significantly to the functioning of our lives. And this might be an intrinsic feature of knowing. That is, part — not just a consequence, but a part — of your knowing a specific truth could be that truth’s mattering to your life. You would not know it to be true simply by caring about its being true, for instance: wishful thinking is not knowing. But the importance to your life of that truth might affect what justificatory standard would need to be met, if you are to know it to be true. In this sense, perhaps satisfying some of one’s practical aims or needs is an inherent part of each case of one’s knowing. Equally, perhaps part of any knowing’s value is thereby its inherently satisfying some personal aims or needs. [For a later version of this idea, sometimes called pragmatic encroachment within knowing, see Fantl and McGrath 2009.]

A normative standard for assertions and other actions. Might knowledge (irrespective of whatever else exactly it is or does) function as a normative standard for much that we do? For example, maybe assertion is apt only when expressing or reflecting knowledge. Perhaps even a much wider range of actions is apt only when they are expressing or reflecting knowledge. In this sense, possibly knowing is an inherent contributor to our living as we should — so that we are performing various actions, such as assertion, only when our doing so is apt. [For these ideas about knowledge’s functioning as a normative standard, see Williamson 2000. On Williamson’s epistemology, see Greenough and Pritchard 2009.]

And thus we have a few possible proposals as to knowing’s possible point, bearing upon what knowledge’s inherent value could be. We might blend some or all of them with ideas from earlier in the article, ideas bearing upon knowing’s nature. Some of those combinations will be more natural than others; unless, of course, none of them will be even a little natural. We should not forget the possibility of knowing’s failing to have a point or value in itself. Maybe it will lack, at any rate, all value beyond whatever value is inherent in the presence of a true belief — in one’s being correct at all in a belief about something at all.

Let's close with another idea, touching upon those others:

Existing with value. Perhaps there are few, if any, particular facts which one needs to know in order to exist. But imagine existing while knowing nothing. (Maybe this would reflect a combination of circumstances. First, possibly some of your beliefs would be false. Second, if knowledge is more than true belief — something questioned in section 6.e — then perhaps you would have true beliefs which fail in a further way to be knowledge. Third, presumably some truths escape your attention altogether.) Quite possibly, we would regard such an existence — wholly empty of knowing — as somehow devalued, somehow failing. Bear in mind that there could still be actions and opinions aplenty within your life; but (given the imagined scenario) never would there be knowledge either in them or guiding them. And if such an existence would be a failure to that extent, then perhaps the inherent point or value in knowing a particular truth is the point or value in knowing at all — with this being, in turn, some more or less substantial part of the point or value in living at all.

That proposal is highly programmatic. It would make knowing’s value personal, in an existential way. It would be one’s existing’s having a value which it would otherwise lack (if it was not to include knowing). Hopefully, there are other potential sources of value within a life. But maybe knowing is one aspect of living with value. Without knowing, possibly one’s living lacks part of its possible point — regardless of how, more specifically and fully, we describe that point.

This suggestion, although vague, is substantive enough to imply that if one was to know nothing then to a correlative extent (however far that extent reaches) one would not be alive in a valuable way. To that same extent, one’s living at all would be devalued inherently. (One might not feel or notice its being so. But it would in fact be so.) Hence, the suggestion has the following explanatory implication, for a start. It could help to illuminate why sceptical doubts (such as in section 4) have been a part of philosophy for so long. That could also be why such doubts should remain present within philosophy, at least as hovering dangers to be defused if possible — and also, if ever defused, to remind us of dangers thereby past. In effect, sceptical doubts question whether our lives, no matter what else we do or accomplish within these, are imbued with as much value as we would otherwise assume to be ours. This threat does not make the sceptical doubts correct, but it might cloak them with a living potency, an existential urgency. It does remind us of why the alternative should be sought: Knowing would be our protection against that potential emptiness within our lives.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Allen, Barry. 2004. Knowledge and Civilization. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Armstrong, D. M. 1973. Belief, Truth and Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bengson, John and Moffett, Marc A. (Eds.). 2012. Knowing How: Essays on Knowledge, Mind, and Action. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bernstein, Richard B. 2010. The Pragmatic Turn. Cambridge: Polity.
  • BonJour, Laurence. 1998. In Defense of Pure Reason: A Rationalist Account of A Priori Justification. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cherniak, Christopher. 1986. Minimal Rationality. Cambridge: The MIT Press.
  • Chisholm, Roderick M. 1989. Theory of Knowledge. 3rd ed. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall.
  • Coady, C. A. J. 1992. Testimony: A Philosophical Study. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Cohen, Stewart. 1986. “Knowledge and Context.” The Journal of Philosophy 83, 574-585.
  • Cohen, Stewart. 1991. “Skepticism, Relevance, and Relativity.” In B. P. McLaughlin, ed., Dretske and His Critics. Cambridge: Blackwell, 17-37.
  • Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard. 2004. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Craig, Edward. 1990. Knowledge and the State of Nature: An Essay in Conceptual Synthesis. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Dancy, Jonathan. (Ed.). 1988. Perceptual Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • DePaul, Michael R. and Ramsey, William. (Eds.). 1998. Rethinking Intuition: The Psychology of Intuition and its Role in Philosophical Inquiry. Lanham: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • DeRose, Keith. 1999. “Contextualism: An Explanation and Defense.” In J. Greco and E. Sosa, eds., The Blackwell Guide to Epistemology. Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell, 187-205.
  • DeRose, Keith. 2009. The Case for Contextualism: Knowledge, Skepticism, and Context, Volume 1. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • DeRose, Keith and Warfield, Ted A. (Eds.). 1999. Skepticism: A Contemporary Reader. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Descartes, René. 1911 [1641]. “Meditation I.” In E. S. Haldane and G. R. T. Ross, eds. and trans., The Philosophical Works of Descartes, Volume I. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Dougherty, Trent. 2011. “Fallibilism.” In S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard, eds., The Routledge Companion to Epistemology. New York: Routledge, 131-143.
  • Dougherty, Trent and Rysiew, Patrick. 2009. “Fallibilism, Epistemic Possibility, and Concessive Knowledge Attributions.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 78, 123-132.
  • Fantl, Jeremy and McGrath, Matthew. 2009. Knowledge in an Uncertain World. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Feldman, Richard. 2003. Epistemology. Upper Saddle River, New Jersey: Prentice Hall.
  • Gettier, Edmund L. 1963. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis 23, 121-123.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. 1979. “What is Justified Belief?” In G. S. Pappas, ed., Justification and Knowledge: New Studies in Epistemology. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1-23.
  • Goldman, Alvin I. 1999. Knowledge In a Social World. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Greco, John. 2010. Achieving Knowledge: A Virtue-Theoretic Account of Epistemic Normativity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Greenough, Patrick and Pritchard, Duncan. (Eds.). 2009. Williamson on Knowledge. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 1996. Knowledge Puzzles: An Introduction to Epistemology. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2001. Good Knowledge, Bad Knowledge: On Two Dogmas of Epistemology. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2005. “Fallibilism.” In J. Fieser and B. Dowden, eds., The Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ISSN 2161-0002, http://www.iep.utm.edu/fallibil/ .
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2011a. How To Know: A Practicalist Conception of Knowledge. Malden: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2011b. “The Gettier Problem.” In S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard, eds., The Routledge Companion to Epistemology. London: Routledge, 119-130.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2011c. “The Significance of Fallibilism Within Gettier’s Challenge: A Case Study.” Philosophia. DOI: 10.1007/s11406-011-9340-7.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2012. “There Can Be Lucky Knowledge.” In M. Steup and J. Turri, eds., Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, 2nd ed. Malden: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel, Howard-Snyder, Frances, and Feit, Neil. 2003. “Infallibilism and Gettier’s Legacy.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 66, 304-327.
  • Kant, Immanuel. 2007 [1781/1787]. Critique of Pure Reason, 2nd ed., trans., N. K. Smith. Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Kornblith, Hilary. 2002. Knowledge and its Place In Nature. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Kvanvig, Jonathan L. 2003. The Value of Knowledge and the Pursuit of Understanding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2008. Learning From Words: Testimony as a Source of Knowledge. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, David. 1996. “Elusive Knowledge.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74, 549-567.
  • Lycan, William G. 2006. “On the Gettier Problem Problem.” In S. Hetherington, ed., Epistemology Futures. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 148-168.
  • Morton, Adam. 2003. A Guide Through the Theory of Knowledge, 3rd ed. Malden: Blackwell.
  • Morton, Adam. 2011. “Contrastivism.” In S. Bernecker and D. Pritchard, eds., The Routledge Companion to Epistemology. London: Routledge, 513-522.
  • Moser, Paul K. (Ed.). 1987. A Priori Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. 2005. Epistemic Luck. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. 2012. “There Cannot Be Lucky Knowledge.” In M. Steup and J. Turri, eds., Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, 2nd ed. Malden: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Quine, Willard V. 1969. “Epistemology Naturalized.” In W. V. Quine, Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press, 69-90.
  • Rorty, Richard. 1979. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1959 [1912]. The Problems of Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1949. The Concept of Mind. London: Hutchinson.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1971 [1946]. “Knowing How and Knowing That.” In G. Ryle, Collected Papers, Volume II. London: Hutchinson, 212-225.
  • Sartwell, Crispin. 1991. “Knowledge Is Merely True Belief.” American Philosophical Quarterly 28, 157-165.
  • Sartwell, Crispin. 1992. “Why Knowledge Is Merely True Belief.” The Journal of Philosophy 89, 167-180.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan. 2005. “Contrastive Knowledge.” In J. Hawthorne and T. Gendler, eds., Oxford Studies in Epistemology, Volume I. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 235-271.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan. 2007. “Knowing the Answer.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 75, 383-403.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid F. 1963. “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind.” In W. F. Sellars, Science, Perception and Reality. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 127-196.
  • Shope, Robert K. 1983. The Analysis of Knowing: A Decade of Research. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2007. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume I. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2009. Reflective Knowledge: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume II. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Stanley, Jason. 2005. Knowledge and Practical Interests. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Stich, Stephen P. (Ed.). 1975. Innate Ideas. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Stroud, Barry. 1984. The Significance of Philosophical Scepticism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Weinberg, Jonathan M. 2006. “What’s Epistemology For? The Case for Neopragmatism in Normative Metaepistemology.” In S. Hetherington, ed., Epistemology Futures. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 26-47.
  • Weinberg, Jonathan, Nichols, Shaun, and Stich, Stephen. 2001. “Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions.” Philosophical Topics 29, 429-460.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Zagzebski, Linda T. 1994. “The Inescapability of Gettier Problems.” The Philosophical Quarterly 44, 65-73.
  • Zagzebski, Linda T. 1996. Virtues of the Mind: An Inquiry Into the Nature of Virtue and the Ethical Foundations of Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Zagzebski, Linda T. 2009. On Epistemology. Belmont: Wadsworth.

 

Author Information

Stephen Hetherington
Email: s.hetherington@unsw.edu.au
University of New South Wales
Australia

Epistemic Luck

Epistemic luck is a generic notion used to describe any of a number of ways in which it can be accidental, coincidental, or fortuitous that a person has a true belief. For example, one can form a true belief as a result of a lucky guess, as when one believes through guesswork that “C” is the right answer to a multiple-choice question and one’s belief just happens to be correct. One can form a true belief via wishful thinking; for example, an optimist’s belief that it will not rain may luckily turn out to be correct, despite forecasts for heavy rain all day. One can reason from false premises to a belief that coincidentally happens to be true. One can accidentally arrive at a true belief through invalid or fallacious reasoning. And one can fortuitously arrive at a true belief from testimony that was intended to mislead but unwittingly reported the truth. In all of these cases, it is just a matter of luck that the person has a true belief.

Until the twenty-first century, there was nearly universal agreement among epistemologists that epistemic luck is incompatible with knowledge. Call this view “the incompatibility thesis.” In light of the incompatibility thesis, epistemic luck presents epistemologists with three distinct but related challenges. The first is that of providing an accurate analysis of knowledge (in terms of individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for “S knows that p,” where ‘S’ represents the knower and ‘p’ represents the proposition known). An adequate analysis of knowledge must succeed in specifying conditions that rule out all instances of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck. The second challenge is to resolve the skeptical paradox that the ubiquity of epistemic luck generates: As will become clear in section 2c, epistemic luck is an all-pervasive phenomenon. Coupling this fact with the incompatibility thesis entails that we have no propositional knowledge. The non-skeptical epistemologist must somehow reconcile the strong intuition that epistemic luck is not compatible with knowledge with the equally evident observation that it must be. The third challenge concerns the special skeptical threat that epistemic luck seems to pose for more reflective forms of knowledge, such as knowing that one knows. Each of these challenges will be explored in the present article.

Table of Contents

  1. Epistemic Luck and the Analysis of Knowledge
    1. The Incompatibility Thesis
    2. The Justified-True-Belief Analysis of Knowledge
    3. The Gettier Problem
    4. Purported Solutions to the Gettier Problem
      1. No False Grounds
      2. No Essential False Grounds
      3. Defeasibility Approaches
      4. The Externalist Turn
      5. The Causal Theory of Knowing
    5. Controversial Cases
      1. Beneficial Falsehoods
      2. Misleading Evidence One Does Not Possess
      3. Impact of These Cases
    6. Where Things Stand
  2. The Paradox of Epistemic Luck
    1. The Knowledge Thesis
    2. The Incompatibility Thesis (Again)
    3. The Ubiquity Thesis
    4. The Skeptical Challenge
    5. Rejecting the Incompatibility Thesis
    6. Knowledge-Destroying Epistemic Luck
      1. Evidential vs. Veritic Luck
      2. Justification-Oriented Luck
      3. Modal Veritic Luck
    7. Second-Wave Anti-Luck Epistemologies
      1. Sensitivity
      2. Safety
    8. Paradox Lost
  3. Epistemic Luck and Knowing that One Knows
    1. Internalism, Epistemic Luck, and the Problem of Knowing that One Knows
    2. Epistemic Luck and Reflective Knowledge
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Epistemic Luck and the Analysis of Knowledge

There is no settled agreement as to how best to characterize the accidentality or fortuitousness of an epistemically lucky true belief. Some have attempted to cash out the accidentality of epistemically lucky beliefs modally. For example, Mark Heller (1999) contends that person S’s belief that p is epistemically lucky (and hence not knowledge) if p is true in the actual world, but there is at least one world, in a contextually-determined set of possible worlds, where S’s belief that p is false. On Duncan Pritchard’s modal characterization (2005), S’s belief is epistemically lucky if it is true in the actual world, but false in a majority of nearby possible worlds where S forms the belief in the same way. Others (Riggs 2007; Coffman 2007) insist that epistemic luck be cashed out in terms of a lack of control condition. Each of these proposals has been criticized in the literature. Despite the lack of agreement concerning the exact nature of epistemic luck, there is widespread agreement that epistemic luck is incompatible with knowledge.

One of the earliest recorded illustrations of knowledge-destroying luck can be found in Plato’s Theaetetus. In this dialogue, Socrates inquires as to what knowledge is. When Theaetetus suggests that knowledge is true belief, Socrates quickly convinces him that he is mistaken by noting that a jury may luckily arrive at a true belief either as a result of the rhetorical skill of a jurist intent on getting a certain verdict or on the basis of unsubstantiated hearsay, and in either case, the lucky true belief would fall short of knowledge. The Socratic challenge posed in the Theaetetus is to specify what must be added to true belief to get knowledge. To meet that challenge, one must provide an analysis of knowledge that correctly identifies the conditions that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for S to know that p (where ‘S’ represents the knower and ‘p’ represents the proposition known). As will become readily apparent in what follows, the possibility of epistemic luck makes the already difficult task of meeting the Socratic challenge all the more difficult.

a. The Incompatibility Thesis

Epistemologists have long agreed with Plato that epistemic luck is incompatible with knowledge. To see just how widespread commitment to the incompatibility thesis is, consider the remarks of just few representative epistemologists. In The Problems of Philosophy (1912, p. 131), Bertrand Russell asks the question: “Can we ever know anything at all, or do we merely sometimes by good luck believe what is true?”—the implication being that lucky true belief is not knowledge. In Theory of Knowledge (1990, p. 12), Keith Lehrer stresses that knowledge requires more than lucky true acceptance: “If I accept something without evidence or justification . . . and, as luck would have it, this turns out to be right, I fall short of knowing that what I have accepted is true.” In Reasons and Knowledge (1981, p. 31), Marshall Swain maintains that: “lucky guesses do not constitute factual knowledge.” In his Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy article on the analysis of knowledge (2006), Matthias Steup expressly endorses the incompatibility thesis: “Let us refer to a belief's turning out to be true because of mere luck as epistemic luck. It is uncontroversial that knowledge is incompatible with epistemic luck.” In his Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy article on epistemology (2007), David Truncellito concurs: “a lucky guess cannot constitute knowledge. Similarly, misinformation and faulty reasoning do not seem like a recipe for knowledge, even if they happen to lead to a true belief.” In Epistemic Luck (2005, p. 1), Duncan Pritchard calls attention to “the seemingly universal intuition that knowledge excludes luck, or, to put it another way, that the epistemic luck that sometimes enables one to have true beliefs . . . is incompatible with knowledge.”

The nearly universal intuition that epistemic luck is incompatible with knowledge is rooted in compelling examples like the following:

Jack of Hearts

Dylan is an avid euchre player. One night between hands, the dealer asks Dylan which card he believes to be on the top of the freshly shuffled euchre deck. Dylan thinks for a moment and, recalling his fondness of bowers, comes to believe that the top card is the jack of hearts. After Dylan reports his belief, the dealer turns over the top card, which just so happens to be the jack of hearts.

Since the probability of the jack of hearts being the top card of a randomly shuffled euchre deck is 1/32, it is just a matter of luck that Dylan’s belief was true. Dylan certainly didn’t know that the jack of hearts was the top card. He just happened to guess correctly, and knowledge requires more than lucky guesswork.

b. The Justified-True-Belief Analysis of Knowledge

Examples like Jack of Hearts clearly show that true belief is not sufficient for knowledge. What, then, must be added to true belief in order to get knowledge? Prior to 1963, most epistemologists maintained that justification is what is required to convert true belief to knowledge, and as a result, they endorsed the justified-true-belief analysis of knowledge:

(JTB)   For any subject S and any proposition p, S knows that p if and only if:

(i) p is true,

(ii) S believes that p [Bp], and

(iii) S is justified in believing that p [Jp].

Fallibilists and infallibilists disagree about the kind of justification required by (iii). Infallibilists maintain that knowledge requires infallible justification. Infallible justification entails the truth of the proposition for which it is justification. Fallibilists, on the other hand, endorse a weaker justification requirement. They contend that the kind of justification requisite for knowledge need only render probable, but need not entail, that for which it is justification.

At first blush, it might look as if infallible justification holds the key to eliminating epistemic luck and is, thus, the kind of justification needed for knowledge. After all, if S believes that p on the basis of infallible truth-entailing justification for p, it is impossible for S to be mistaken with respect to p. Unfortunately, the legacy of infallibilism is nearly wholesale skepticism. The point can be demonstrated as follows: Since our evidence for the non-cogito contingent empirical propositions we believe never entails the truth of those propositions, it follows that if the kind of justification required for knowledge is infallible truth-entailing justification, then we are never justified in believing, and hence never know, that such propositions are true. An infallibilist justification requirement would go a long way toward eliminating epistemic luck, but it would do so at the cost of making empirical knowledge impossible—hardly an adequate non-skeptical solution to the problem of epistemic luck.

Recognizing the skeptical implications of infallibilism, most contemporary epistemologists have embraced fallibilism so that empirical knowledge remains at least in principle possible. Fallibilistic justification is thought to rule out epistemic luck by making one’s belief extremely probable. When one’s belief that p is extremely probable, it is not just a matter of luck that one’s belief is true. Recall Jack of Hearts. Prior to the dealer’s turning over the top card, Dylan has no evidence as to what the top card is. As such, it is extremely improbable that the top card is the jack of hearts. Consider how Dylan’s epistemic situation changes after the dealer turns over the top card, and Dylan sees the jack of hearts. Now Dylan has good perceptual evidence that the card is the jack of hearts. Given his newly-acquired perceptual evidence, it is now extremely probable that the card is the jack of hearts, and as a result, it is no longer just a matter of luck that his belief that it is the jack of hearts is true. Granted, it is possible that a Cartesian evil demon could have caused Dylan to hallucinate the jack of hearts right as the dealer flipped over some other card (which illustrates that Dylan’s perceptual evidence doesn’t entail that the card is the jack of hearts), and so, his evidence doesn’t eliminate all chance of error; but it does make the chance of error extremely low, and when error is extremely improbable, it is not simply a matter of luck that one’s belief is true.

c. The Gettier Problem

Although the role of the justification condition in the JTB-analysis is to rule out lucky guesses as instances of knowledge, it remains possible, given any fallibilistic account of justification, to have a justified belief that is only luckily true, a fact that went largely unnoticed until the publication of Edmund Gettier’s seminal article “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” (1963). Therein, Gettier provides two compelling counterexamples to the JTB-analysis of knowledge. He dubs these examples “Case I” and “Case II.” Both cases involve a person who justifiably comes to believe a true proposition by validly deducing it from a justified-but-false belief. Consider first Gettier’s Case II.

Case II: Smith has good evidence for believing that Jones owns a Ford [J]. Indeed, Smith’s evidence for thinking that Jones owns a Ford is at least as strong as the evidence that we typically have for thinking that our friends and family members own the cars they do. Smith’s evidence consists of the following: As far back as Smith can remember, Jones has always owned a Ford; just that morning, Jones gave Smith a ride while driving a Ford; and Smith was with Jones a few months back when Jones purchased a Ford exactly like the one she was driving when she offered Smith the ride earlier that morning. Based on this evidence, Smith justifiedly believes that Jones owns a Ford [J]. On the basis of her justified belief that J, Smith justifiedly deduces and comes to believe the disjunction that either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Barcelona [J or B], despite having no idea of Brown’s whereabouts. As it turns out, Jones no longer owns a Ford. She recently sold her Ford and is driving a rental. However, purely by coincidence, Brown happens to be in Barcelona. Obviously, it is just a matter of luck that Smith’s justified belief that J or B is true. Nearly every epistemologist who has considered this case agrees that Smith’s luck-infused justified-true-belief that J or B falls short of knowledge.

Here is a slightly modified version Gettier’s other example. Case I: While waiting for a job interview, Smith sees Nelson take the coins out of her pocket, count them (ten coins in all), and then put them back in her pocket. Smith also overhears the boss on the phone telling someone that Nelson is the person who will get the job. On the basis of this evidence, Smith justifiedly believes the conjunction:

(N)  Nelson will get the job, and Nelson has ten coins in her pocket.

On basis of her justified belief that N, Smith deduces and justifiedly comes to believe:

(P)  The person who will get the job has ten coins in her pocket.

Despite Smith’s evidence, N is false. The boss misspoke on the phone. Actually, it is Smith, not Nelson, who will get the job, and purely by chance, Smith happens to have exactly ten coins in her pocket. Once again, it is just a matter of luck that Smith’s belief—this time her belief that P—is true. With these two examples, Gettier showed that fallibilistic justification is incapable of eliminating all forms of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck and that, as a result, justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge.

d. Purported Solutions to the Gettier Problem

Gettier’s paper gave rise to a plethora of articles attempting to solve the problem that now bears his name. Many of these purported solutions sought to resolve the problem by supplementing the JTB-analysis with a fourth condition, while others abandoned the JTB-analysis in favor of non-traditional ajustificational accounts of knowledge. Consider first some of the prominent fourth condition responses.

i. No False Grounds

In both of Gettier’s examples, Smith justifiably infers a true belief from a justified-but-false belief, and it has seemed to many that a true belief is not knowledge when it is deduced from a false belief. As a result, a number of epistemologists sought to resolve the Gettier problem by supplementing JTB with a “No False Grounds” clause along the following lines:

(NFG) S knows that p if and only if (i) p is true, (ii) S believes that p, (iii) S is justified in believing that p, and (iv) S’s justification for p does not rest on any false beliefs.

An analysis of knowledge can be too strong or too weak: It is too strong if it is possible for a person to know that p without satisfying all of the conditions spelled out in the analysis. It is too weak if one can fail to know that p when all the conditions in the analysis have been met. To see that NFG is too strong, we need only modify Gettier’s Case II as follows:

Café

Smith is sitting in a café in Barcelona with Brown having a cup of espresso. While there, with Brown, Smith justifiably infers and comes to believe that J or B on the basis of her justified-but-false belief that Jones owns a Ford [J] and on the basis of her justified-true-belief that Brown is Barcelona [B].

In this scenario, Smith has excellent evidence for B along with her misleading evidence for J. Since Smith knows B is true and validly deduces J or B from her knowledge that B, it is not at all lucky that her justified belief that J or B is true; and so, Smith knows that J or B, despite the fact that part of her evidence, namely, J, is false. Hence, NFG is false, for it entails that a person fails to know that p whenever any part (even a dispensable and thus superfluous part) of her justification is false, when, intuitively, a person with some false evidence for p can still know that p provided she has at least one independent chain of all-true-evidence justification for p.

ii. No Essential False Grounds

In Gettier’s Case II (where Smith clearly fails to know that J or B), Smith’s justification for J or B essentially depends on Smith’s justified-but-false belief that J. In Café (where intuitively Smith does know that J or B), Smith has two independent strands of justification for J or B. The first strand is her justified-but-false belief that J. The second strand is her justified-true-belief that B. As a result, Smith could dispense with the first strand entirely and still be justified in believing the disjunction J or B. Our markedly different appraisals of Smith’s epistemic status vis-à-vis J or B in these two cases suggest that the presence of false grounds precludes the knowledge that p only when those grounds play an indispensable role in a person’s justification for p. Given this insight, it might seem that the no false grounds condition in NFG should be replaced with a no essential false grounds condition as follows:

(NEFG)  S knows that p if and only if (i) p is true, (ii) S believes that p, (iii) S is justified in believing that p, and (iv) S’s justification for p does not essentially depend on any false beliefs.

Unfortunately, NEFG is too weak because there can be all-true-evidence Gettier cases—cases where the person’s justification for her lucky true belief does not depend on any false beliefs. An example of an all-true-evidence Gettier case is provided by Brian Skyrms’s (1967) case involving Sure-Fire matches:

Pyromaniac

Pete knows that Sure-Fire matches have always lit in the past when struck. Pete also knows that the match he is holding is a Sure-Fire match. Based on this evidence, which he knows to be true, Pete justifiably believes that the match he is holding will light when struck [L]. Unbeknownst to Pete, the match he is holding is a defective Sure-Fire match (the first ever!) with impurities that raise its combustion temperature above that which can be produced by striking friction. As luck would have it, just as Pete strikes the match, a sudden burst of Q-radiation ignites the match.

In Pyromaniac, Pete has a justified true belief that L, which is based entirely on true evidence that Pete knows, and yet, it is still just a matter of luck that his belief is true. This example shows that one can have a lucky true belief that p that falls short of knowledge, even when all of one’s evidence for p is true. Thus, NEFG is too weak. There are genuine Gettier cases that it fails to rule out.

iii. Defeasibility Approaches

In each of Gettier’s original cases, there is a true proposition unbeknownst to Smith such that were that proposition added to the rest of Smith’s evidence, Smith would no longer be justified in believing the Gettiered belief. Call such a proposition a defeater. In Case I, the defeater is the true proposition that Nelson will not get the job [~N]. If ~N were added to Smith’s evidence, Smith would not be justified in believing that the person who will get the job has ten coins in her pocket, for she would no longer have any idea who will get the job. In Case II, the defeater is the true proposition that Jones does not own a Ford [~J]. Since Smith has no knowledge as to Brown’s whereabouts, if ~J were added to Smith’s evidence, she would no longer be justified in believing that J or B. Notice, however, that in the case of Café (where Smith is with Brown in Barcelona), the true proposition ~J is not a defeater, because adding ~J to Smith’s evidence in Café would not prevent Smith from being justified in believing that J or B. Smith would still be justified in believing J or B on the basis of her justified true belief that B.

Defeasibility theorists contend that a person fails to know that p whenever there is a defeater for her justification for p. Their proposal for solving the Gettier problem is to supplement the JTB-analysis with a No Defeaters condition as follows:

(ND)    S knows that p if and only if (i) p is true, (ii) S believes that p, (iii) S is justified in believing that p, and (iv) there are no defeaters for S’s justification for p.

The biggest problem facing the No Defeaters approach is that there is no agreement among defeasibility theorists themselves as to the correct account of defeaters. For example, Roderick Chisholm (1964) and Peter Klein (1971) have characterized defeaters as follows:

(D1)     When evidence e justifies S in believing that p, then proposition d is a defeater for S’s justification if and only if (i) d is true and (ii) the conjunction of d and e does not justify S in believing that p.

Keith Lehrer and Thomas Paxson Jr. (1969) contend that D1 is too weak, as a definition of defeaters, because it counts as defeaters certain statements that intuitively are not defeaters. They offer the following case in point:

Grabit

While at the library, I see a student of mine, Tom Grabit, take a book from the shelf, conceal it under his coat, and leave the library without checking it out. I know Tom Grabit well, and I am sure that he stole the book. I justifiedly believe that Tom Grabit stole the book, and he did.

Intuitively, I know that Tom Grabit stole the book. But here’s the rub: Unbeknownst to me, Tom Grabit’s mother said that on the day in question Tom was not in the library, indeed, he was thousands of miles away, and that Tom’s identical twin, John Grabit, was in the library. On the D1 account of defeaters, the following true proposition is a defeater for my justification for thinking that Tom stole the book:

(M) Tom’s mother said that Tom was not in the library at the time of the theft, but his identical twin John was.

If M were added to my evidence, I would no longer be justified in believing that Tom stole the book. This result might seem like the right result until we discover that Tom’s mother is both delusional and a pathological liar, that she said these things to herself in her padded cell, that John Grabit is a figment of her demented mind, and that Tom stole the book just as I thought. Lehrer and Paxson argue that the fact that it is true that a delusional mental patient uttered false statements about Tom Grabit’s location on the day of the theft should not defeat my knowledge that Tom Stole the book. They conclude that the Chisholm/Klein account of defeaters should be replaced with the follow account:

(D2)     When evidence e justifies S in believing that p, then proposition d is a defeater for S’s justification if and only if (i) d is true, (ii) S is completely justified in believing that d is false, and (iii) the conjunction of d and e does not justify S in believing that p.

In Grabit, I do not have any evidence concerning what Tom’s mother said or didn’t say, and so, I am not completely justified in believing that it is false that she said those things. As a result, condition (ii) of D2 is not satisfied, and so, on the Lehrer/Paxson account of defeaters that fact that Ms. Grabit said those things is not a defeater for my evidence that Tom stole the book. Consequently, on the D2-account of defeaters, I have an undefeated justified true belief that Tom stole the book and thus know that Tom stole the book, which is the intuitively correct result.

The Chisholm/Klein D1-account of defeaters gets the Grabit case wrong, for it entails that the true statement M defeats my justification for thinking that Tom stole the book. Since M is a defeater on the Chisholm/Klein account, their account entails that I do not know that Tom stole the book; when, intuitively, I do know that Tom stole the book. I saw him steal it, and the insane ramblings of his demented mother do nothing to undermine my knowledge.

Now consider a different case:

Locked

John Lock is compulsive when it comes to locking his doors. This morning when he left for work, he locked the front door and tripled checked that the door was locked. It is now 11:00 a.m., and John is sitting in his office recalling his morning ritual. He clearly and distinctly remembers locking his front door and triple checking to make sure that it was in fact locked. On the basis of this vivid memorial evidence e, he comes to believe that his front door is locked. Lucy Lock, John’s wife, is notoriously unreliable about locking the doors when she leaves home, which is why John always insists on leaving home after Lucy leaves for work. Unbeknownst to John, Lucy forgot her workout clothes and returned home at 10:30 a.m. to retrieve them, and she just happened to lock the door when she left five minutes later.

So, at 11:00 a.m., John’s belief that the front door is locked is true. Presumably, John does not know that the front door is locked. He thinks the door is locked because he remembers locking it, but that is not why it is locked. It is locked because Lucy absentmindedly and uncharacteristically happened to lock it on her way out. Intuitively, John’s knowledge is defeated by the following true proposition:

(U) The door was unlocked by Lucy at 10:30 a.m.

If U were added to John’s memorial evidence e, John would no longer be justified in believing that his front door is locked. On the Chisholm/Klein D1-account of defeaters, U is a defeater because U is true and the conjunction of U and e would not justify John in believing that his front door is locked. However, on the Lehrer/Paxson D2-account of defeaters, U would not count as a defeater because sitting in his office at 11:00 a.m., John has no evidence concerning whether or not his wife returned home to retrieve her gym clothes, and so, he is not completely justified in believing it false that the door was unlocked by Lucy Lock at 10:30 a.m. Since U is not a defeater on the Lehrer/Paxson account, their account entails that John knows that his front door is locked; when, intuitively, he fails to know that his door is locked, because it is just a matter of luck that Lucy absentmindedly locked it when she left.

The problem for the No Defeaters approach, then, is this: D1 is too weak of an account of defeaters, and as a result, employing a D1-account of defeaters in ND would make ND too strong an account of knowledge; whereas D2 is too strong an account of defeaters, and so, employing it in ND would make ND too weak. Absent an adequate account of defeaters, the No Defeaters approach fails to provide a solution to the problem of epistemic luck.

iv. The Externalist Turn

Externalist theories of justification maintain that epistemic justification is (at least) partly a function of features external to the cognizer, that is, features outside the cognizer’s ken. For example, one prominent externalist theory, process reliabilism, makes a belief’s justificatory status a function of the actual reliability (rather than the perceived reliability) of the process producing that belief. One motivation behind externalism with respect to justification is its unique ability to provide a truth connection that conceptually links justification with truth. To appreciate the importance of this motivation, recall that the role of the justification condition in the JTB-analysis is to rule out lucky guesses as instances of knowledge. In order for justification to be able to properly play that role, there must be some sort of internal connection between justification and truth that makes the former objectively indicative of the latter. Indeed, many epistemologists insist that it is precisely its internal connection to truth that distinguishes epistemic justification from moral and pragmatic justification. To be objectively indicative of truth, justification must be conceptually connected (not merely coincidentally or contingently connected) with truth. In order for there to be a conceptual connection between justification and truth, the following condition must hold: In every possible world W, if conditions C make belief b justified in W, then conditions C also make b objectively probable in W. The rationale for requiring such a truth connection is this: If there were no conceptual connection between justification and truth, it would be just as much a matter of luck when a justified belief turned out to be true as when an unjustified belief turned out to be true. Moreover, a better justified belief would be no more likely to be true than a much less well justified belief, for without a truth connection, no amount of justification is an objective indication of truth.

Unlike externalist theories of justification, no internalist theory of justification can provide the desired conceptual connection between justification and truth. Internalist theories maintain that epistemic justification is solely a function of states internal to the cognizer, such as perceptual states, belief states, memorial seemings, and introspective states. Examples of such theories include classical foundationalism, coherentism, and evidentialism. That no internalist theory of justification can provide a truth connection can be demonstrated as follows: Every internalist theory of justification maintains that the conditions that make a belief justified are entirely specifiable in terms of states internal to the cognizer, and for any set of entirely internally specifiable justification-conferring conditions, CI, there will always be a possible world, WD, where a Cartesian evil demon has seen to it that S possesses the requisite internal states and, hence, satisfies CI, even though all of S’s contingent empirical beliefs are false. Since the conditions CI that make S’s belief b internalistically justified in WD­­ do not make b objectively probable in WD, no internalist theory is capable of providing a truth connection. Because internalistic justification is not conceptually connected to truth, one can easily be internalistically justified in holding a false belief, which can in turn be used to justifiably infer some other belief that may coincidentally turn out to be true. Consequently, employing an internalistic justification condition in the JTB-analysis makes JTB particularly susceptible to Gettier cases.

At first glance, externalistic justification looks more promising as a means of preventing luck from playing a role in the acquisition of true belief, for some externalist theories of justification do provide a conceptual connection between justification and truth. Consider, for example, the following simplified version of process reliabilism:

(PR)     S’s belief b is justified in world W if and only if S’s belief b is produced by a belief-forming cognitive process [BCP] that is W-reliable (where a -reliable BCP is a process that tends to produce beliefs in W that are true in W).

Since PR asserts that a belief is justified in W if and only if it is produced by a W-reliable BCP, and since, by definition, the beliefs produced by a W-reliable process tend to be true in W, PR-justified beliefs have a high objective probability of being true. Because reliably-produced, externalistically-justified beliefs are objectively likely to be true, one might think that replacing the internalistic justification condition in the traditional JTB-analysis with an externalistic justification condition would render JTB immune to Gettier-style counterexamples. William Harper (1996) quickly dispels any such notion, with the following counterexample:

Falcon

Smith believes that Jones owns a Ford. Smith was with Jones when Jones purchased her Pinto; Smith has seen the official title to the car in Jones’s name; Jones is a reliable informant that has never deceived anyone; and just this morning, Jones gave Smith a ride to work in her Pinto. Smith has a reliably-produced and reliably-sustained belief that Jones owns a Ford. It is now 1:00 p.m. Unbeknownst to Smith, at noon Jones’s Pinto was vaporized by a terrorist bomb; but, also unbeknownst to Smith, exactly at noon Jones won a Ford Falcon in the State Lottery. Hence, Smith has a reliably-formed true belief that Jones owns a Ford, but her belief is not knowledge.

While internalistic justification may be particularly susceptible to being undermined by Gettier-style knowledge-destroying luck, Harper’s counterexample shows that the Gettier problem plagues all fallibilistic theories of justification, both internalistic and externalistic alike. Whatever virtues externalistic justification might have, solving the Gettier problem is not among them.

v. The Causal Theory of Knowing

In his early work, Alvin Goldman (1967) offers a different diagnosis of what has gone wrong in Gettier cases. In Case II, what makes J or B true is the fact that Brown is in Barcelona, but this fact plays no causal role in Smith’s coming to believe that J or B. In Case I, what makes P (P = the person who will get the job has ten coins in her pocket) true is the number of coins in Smith’s pocket, but this fact plays no role in Smith’s coming to believe P. What causes Smith to believe P is the fact that Nelson has ten coins in her pocket, and this latter fact is not what makes P true. Goldman observes that in these cases there is no causal connection between the Gettiered belief and the fact that makes it true. It is the absence of such a connection that allows for the possibility of belief’s being true purely by luck. Goldman concludes that the traditional JTB-analysis should be replaced with the following causal theory of knowledge:

(CTOK)  S knows that p if and only if the fact that p is causally connected in an appropriate way with S’s believing that p.

The appropriate knowledge-producing causal processes that Goldman identifies include: (i) perception, (ii) memory, (iii) inferentially reconstructed causal chains, each inference of which is warranted, and (iv) combinations of (i)-(iii). The causal theory correctly handles all of the cases we have considered so far. We have already seen how it handles Gettier’s original cases. In Café, what makes J or B true is the fact that Brown is in Barcelona, and that fact is appropriately causally connected with Smith’s believing that J or B, because Smith is having an espresso with Brown in Barcelona. Accordingly, CTOK correctly entails that, in Café, Smith knows that J or B. In Grabit, I see Tom steal the book. Tom’s stealing the book in plain eyesight perceptually causes me to believe that he did, and so, once again, CTOK yields the right result: I know that Tom Grabit stole the book. In Locked, what makes it true that the front door is locked is the fact that Lucy locked it, and this fact plays no causal role in John’s believing his front door is locked. In this case, CTOK correctly entails that John does not know that his front door is locked. He’s just lucky that Lucy happened to lock it. Finally, in Falcon, what makes it true that Jones owns a Ford is the fact that she just won a Ford Falcon in the state lottery, and that fact plays no causal role in Smith’s believing that Jones owns a Ford, and so, Smith fails to know that Jones owns a Ford.

Despite its success in handling these cases, the causal theory falls prey to the following counterexample:

Fake Barn County

An eccentric farmer in Minnesota owns all of the land in Fake Barn County. Wanting to appear much richer than he is, this farmer has erected fake barns all throughout the county. From the road, these fake barns look exactly like real barns, when, in reality, they are just two dimensional barn façades. While nearly every barn-looking structure in the county is a fake, there are a few real barns interspersed among the myriad fakes. Henry, who is driving through Fake Barn County, has no idea that there are any fake barns in the county. Looking out the window of his car, Henry sees what looks to be a barn on the hill just up the road and comes to believe that there is a barn on the hill. Purely by chance, Henry happens to be looking at one of the few real barns in the county.

Intuitively, Henry does not know that there is a barn on the hill. He is just lucky to be looking at one of the few real barns in the county. The lucky nature of his present belief becomes even more obvious once we discover that Henry has been forming barn beliefs ever since entering Fake Barn County, and all of these other barn beliefs have been false. Henry has consistently been duped by the façades.

The causal theory fails because it cannot account for Henry’s lack of knowledge in this case. Henry is now looking at one of the few real barns in the county, and this real barn is what is causing him to believe that there is a barn on the hill. Since Henry’s true belief that there is a barn on that hill is appropriately caused via perception by that very barn on that hill, the causal theory mistakenly entails that Henry knows there is a barn on that hill, when clearly he does not.

e. Controversial Cases

As analyses of knowledge aimed as at solving the Gettier problem have grown in sophistication and complexity, so have the purported counterexamples aimed at refuting these analyses. Some of these purported counterexamples are sufficiently complex and controversial that there is no consensus among epistemologists as to whether or not the person in the example knows the proposition in question. Two such cases are discussed below.

i. Beneficial Falsehoods

Although the no essential false grounds approach was largely abandoned once it was shown that there can be all-true-evidence Gettier cases—cases where S’s justification for her lucky belief p does not depend on any false beliefs—there has remained nearly universal agreement among epistemologists that a person fails to know that p if her justification for p essentially depends on a false belief. Peter Klein (2008) is a noteworthy exception. He contends that there can be beneficial falsehoods—falsehoods essential to one’s justification that nevertheless give one knowledge. Here is one example that Klein offers in support of his controversial view:

Appointment

Based on memory, I believe that my secretary told me on Friday that I have an appointment with a student on Monday. Based on that justified-but-false memorial belief, I come to justifiedly believe that I have an appointment on Monday. As it turns out, I do have that appointment on Monday, and my secretary did tell me of the appointment. However, he didn’t tell me on Friday. He told me on Thursday.

Klein contends that I know that I have an appointment on Monday [A], even though my belief that A essentially depends on my false belief that my secretary told me on Friday about my Monday appointment. It might seem that the false belief that my secretary told me on Friday that I have a Monday appointment is not essential to my justification for A, because if I “remember” that my secretary told me on Friday of my Monday appointment, then presumably I also actually remember that my secretary told me I have an appointment on Monday, and this latter belief is true. But suppose that the secretary was out with the flu the first three days of the week, and also suppose that I do not remember being on campus on Thursday. In fact, I’m confident that I wasn’t on campus on Thursday, having totally forgotten that I briefly stopped in on Thursday to get my mail. Klein contends that in such a situation I would not believe that my secretary told me of the appointment at all, unless I believed that he told me this on Friday. Klein contends that I know that A, even though that belief essentially depends on my false belief that my secretary told me on Friday about my Monday appointment.

What distinguishes beneficial falsehoods from knowledge-destroying falsehoods? Under what circumstances does a false belief f allow S to acquire knowledge that p? Klein’s answers to these questions are rooted in and flow out of his preferred theory of knowledge. Klein contends that knowledge requires both propositional and doxastic justification. Proposition p is propositionally justified for S if and only if S has an epistemically adequate basis for p. S’s belief that p is doxastically justified for S if and only if S’s belief that p has an appropriate causal basis. The basic idea is that in order for S to know that p, S’s belief that p must be epistemically justified and appropriately caused. Armed with the distinction between propositional and doxastic justification, Klein argues that a false belief f is a beneficial falsehood just in case the following seven conditions are met: (i) f is false, (ii) S’s belief that f is doxastically justified (that is, S’s belief that f has an appropriate causal pedigree), (iii) the belief that f is essential in the causal production of the belief that p, (iv) f propositionally justifies p, (v) f entails a true proposition t, (vi) t propositionally justifies p, and (vii) whatever doxastically justifies S in believing that f also propositionally justifies t for S. When these conditions are met, Klein contends that the false belief f is “close enough to the truth” to give one knowledge that p. Applied to the case at hand, F is the false proposition that my secretary told me on Friday that I have an appointment on Monday, and T is the true proposition that my secretary told me that I have an appointment on Monday. Klein contends that my belief that F meets all the conditions for being a beneficial falsehood: (i) F is false, (ii) my belief that F is doxastically justified (appropriately caused) by the fact that he did tell me, (iii) my belief that F is essential to my believing that A (for if I didn’t believe F, I would not believe he had told me about an appointment at all and so I would not believe A), (iv) F propositionally justifies A, (v) F entails the true proposition T, (vi) T propositionally justifies A, and (vii) the fact that my secretary told me on Thursday about my Monday appointment propositionally justifies T for me.

Klein contends that, in the case at hand, it doesn’t really matter what day my secretary told me that I have an appointment on Monday. What matters is the fact that he told me. The false belief that he told me on Friday is close enough to the true proposition that he told me as to give me knowledge that I have an appointment on Monday.

While interesting and provocative, Klein’s case is difficult to assess because it depends on controversial assumptions about belief individuation. Is it possible, for example, to believe that my secretary told me on Friday that I have an appointment on Monday [F], without also believing that my secretary told me that I have an appointment on Monday [T]? If not, then rather than providing us with a case of an indispensable knowledge-generating false belief, Klein may have simply given us another case of justificatory over-determination; for if it is impossible to believe F without also believing T, then there seem to be two independent strands of justification only one of which depends on a false belief, in which case Appointment is simply an analogue of Café above.

ii. Misleading Evidence One Does Not Possess

Gilbert Harman (1973) contends that S’s knowledge that p can be undermined by readily available misleading evidence that S does not possess. In Harman cases, despite the fact that the undermining evidence is misleading, if S were to possess it, S would no longer be justified in believing that p. The idea behind Harman cases seems to be this: Since the misleading evidence is readily available, it is just a matter of luck that S does not possess that evidence, and since luck is incompatible with knowledge, S fails to know that p. Here is one of Harman’s cases:

Assassination

A political leader is assassinated. His associates, fearing a coup, decide to pretend that the bullet hit someone else. On Nationwide television they announce that an assassination attempt has failed to kill the leader but has killed a secret service man by mistake. However, before the announcement is made, an enterprising reporter on the scene telephones the real story to his newspaper, which has included the story in its final edition. Jill buys a copy of that paper, reads the story of the assassination, and believes that the President has been assassinated based on the story. What she reads is true, and so are her assumptions about how the story came to be in the paper. (1973, 143)

Harman insists that Jill does not know that the President has been assassinated. He finds it highly implausible that Jill should know simply because she lacks evidence that everyone else possesses. Harman’s diagnosis is that Jill’s knowledge is undermined by readily available evidence – the misleading televised retraction – that she does not possess.

Epistemologists who have reflected on Harman’s Assassination case remain divided over whether or not Jill knows that the President has been assassinated. Those who think that she does know that the President has been assassinated tend to focus on the facts that (i) all of her evidence is true, (ii) she knows her evidence is true, and (iii) the evidence she has is an accurate indicator of the President’s assassination.

Those epistemologists who think that Jill does not know that the President has been assassinated do not focus on the quality of Jill’s evidence, which is impeccable. Rather, they focus on the lucky nature of her evidence. If Jill had turned on the TV when she got home, like she usually does, she would have seen the televised retraction, and she would have found herself in the same epistemic predicament as everyone else. Given the conflicting reports, she would not have known what to believe. Clearly, Jill is lucky to be in the evidential situation she is in. Since luck is generally thought to be incompatible with knowledge, these epistemologists conclude that Jill fails to know that the President has been assassinated.

iii. Impact of These Cases

Controversial cases like these make the challenge of providing an accurate analysis of knowledge even more difficult. If Jill does know that the President has been assassinated, then all those theories of knowledge that imply that she lacks such knowledge (including Harman’s own theory) are mistaken. On the other hand, if Jill does not know that the President has been assassinated, then all those theories that imply she does are mistaken. Similarly, if I do not know that I have an appointment on Monday, then all those theories that imply I do (including Klein’s theory) are mistaken. If I do know that I have an appointment on Monday, then all those theories that imply I lack such knowledge are mistaken. The competing intuitions these cases engender make the already difficult task of arriving at a mutually agreed upon account of knowledge even more formidable.

f. Where Things Stand

While various proponents of the above proposals might still embrace them, the general consensus is that none of the above attempts at eliminating epistemic luck succeeds. One problem with these first attempts at resolving the Gettier problem is that they tended to emerge in a piecemeal fashion as responses to specific counterexamples, only to fall prey to more elaborate counterexamples themselves. What seems to be needed is a better understanding of epistemic luck itself. If we can get clear on the exact nature of knowledge-destroying luck, we might be in a better position to formulate a condition that can eliminate it. The next section will examine a number of attempts at clarifying the nature of knowledge-destroying luck and will assess several modal conditions that have been proposed to eliminate such luck.

2. The Paradox of Epistemic Luck

In addition to generating problems for those epistemologists seeking an analysis of knowledge, the phenomenon of epistemic luck gives rise to an epistemological paradox in its own right. The paradox is generated by the following three theses: the knowledge thesis, the incompatibility thesis, and the ubiquity thesis. The paradox arises because each of these theses is antecedently plausible, but together they form an inconsistent triad. Each thesis is discussed below.

a. The Knowledge Thesis

According to the knowledge thesis, we possess a great deal of knowledge about the world around us. Commonsense tells us that the knowledge thesis is true. For example, I know that I am in a coffee shop. I know that I am drinking a cup of coffee. I know that I am wearing a blue shirt. I know that I am typing on a laptop computer. And I know that the person sitting next to me is talking on his cell phone at an inappropriate volume. You know that you have eyes. You know that you are reading an IEP article on epistemic luck. You know that the article you are reading is written in English. Together, we know a lot. At least, we think we do, until we encounter a skeptical paradox like the paradox of epistemic luck.

b. The Incompatibility Thesis (Again)

The incompatibility thesis is the thesis that epistemic luck simpliciter is incompatible with knowledge. As noted above, there has been nearly universal agreement among epistemologists that knowledge is incompatible with epistemic luck. The post-Gettier literature is replete with evermore-sophisticated counterexamples to the array of purported accounts of knowledge proffered in an effort to resolve the Gettier problem. The standard formula for generating a counterexample to a purported analysis of knowledge is to conjure up a case where, despite satisfying all the conditions in the analysis, it is still just a matter of luck that the person’s belief that p is true. The element of luck involved is ipso facto thought to prevent the belief from being an instance of knowledge. The nearly unanimous acceptance of such examples illustrates just how widespread commitment to the incompatibility thesis is.

c. The Ubiquity Thesis

Epistemic luck is an all-pervasive phenomenon that infects every fallibilistic epistemology in one form or other. Its inescapability can be demonstrated as follows: To convert true belief to knowledge, every viable fallibilistic epistemology requires satisfying either some internalistic justification condition or some externalistic condition (that may or may not be a justification condition). But neither an internalistic nor an externalistic condition can completely succeed in eliminating epistemic luck. A little recognized consequence of the new evil demon problem is that internalistic justification is not conceptually connected to truth in any robust way, for demon-world victims have internalistically justified beliefs almost all of which are false. Given the absence of a robust truth connection, it is always in some sense a matter of luck when a merely internalistically justified belief turns out to be true. To see why, consider my twin in an evil demon world WD. By hypothesis, he has the same beliefs that I have, he has the same memorial seemings that I have, he possesses the same experiential evidence that I possess, and he goes through exactly the same internal reflections that I do. In short, our internal cognitive lives are phenomenologically, doxastically, and reflectively indistinguishable. Consequently, if I satisfy the internal conditions for justifiedness (whatever they may be), then my demon-world twin satisfies them as well, and so, we are both internalistically justified in our beliefs. If, on the other hand, I fail to satisfy those conditions, then my twin also fails to satisfy them, and so neither of us is internalistically justified in our beliefs. Now assume the former scenario where both of us are internalistically justified in our beliefs. The only relevant difference between my twin and me is that he is being systematically deceived, whereas, as epistemic good fortune would have it, I am not. If he and I were to change places, there would be no introspectable difference, and each of us would continue to believe as we do, only now I would be the hapless victim of demon deception. Clearly, I am epistemically fortunate to be in the world I am in (assuming I am in the world I take myself to be in) and not in WD. Since I am lucky to be in the world I am in, there is a clear sense in which it is epistemically lucky that my internalistically justified beliefs are true. My twin is not nearly so lucky, for, thanks to the demon, all of his internalistically justified beliefs are false. Since these results can be generated no matter which internalistic theory of justification one employs, it is always a matter of luck when a merely internalistically justified belief happens to be true.

Truth-connected externalist approaches (for example, reliabilist, truth-tracking, and safety-based accounts) avoid this kind of epistemic luck. However, they are subject to another kind of ineliminable epistemic luck. Recall, from section 1, the externalistic process-reliabilist account of epistemic justification:

(PR)     S’s belief b is justified in world W if and only if S’s belief b is produced by a belief-forming cognitive process that is W-reliable.

Call a belief that is justified in virtue of being reliably produced a PR-justified belief. Although it is not typically a matter of luck when a PR-justified belief turns out to be true (since PR-justification is conceptually connected to truth), it is a matter of luck when a belief turns out to be PR-justified. To see why, consider, once again, my twin in the demon world WD. By hypothesis, he and I share the same beliefs, possess the same evidence, go through the same internal reflections, and have phenomenologically, doxastically, and reflectively indistinguishable cognitive lives. Even so, our beliefs do not have the same PR-justificatory status. His beliefs are not PR-justified, because they are produced by processes that the demon has rendered unreliable in WD, whereas my beliefs are PR-justified because they are produced by processes that are reliable in the actual world (Again, I’m assuming, for the sake of the example, that the actual world is the world we think it is.). According to PR, it is not a matter of luck that my beliefs are true and his beliefs are false, because my beliefs are PR-justified and his are not, and PR-justified beliefs have a high objective probability of being true. What is a matter of luck is the fact that my beliefs are PR-justified and his are not. After all, we both take ourselves to be in non-demon-manipulated worlds, and we both take ourselves to have reliably-produced PR-justified beliefs. As luck and ill luck, respectively, would have it, I am correct and he is incorrect. Since there is no introspectively discernible difference between our worlds, given what each of us has to go on, there is a clear sense in which I could have just as easily been mistaken and been the one with demon-rendered-unreliable processes. Compared to my twin, I am epistemically fortunate to be in a non-demon world where my cognitive faculties are reliable. Since I am epistemically lucky (compared with my twin) to be in a world where I have reliable cognitive processes, there is clearly a sense in which it is just a matter of luck that I have PR-justified beliefs.

Analogous considerations can be applied to any externalistic constraint on knowledge. Consider the externalistic condition of being a safe belief (to be explained below). While a safe belief’s being true is not epistemically lucky, having safe beliefs is epistemically lucky, for in a demon world none of one’s beliefs are safe. Since every fallibilistic epistemology incorporates either an internalistic justification condition or an externalistic condition, no fallibilistic epistemology can rid us of epistemic luck’s intractable presence.

d. The Skeptical Challenge

Epistemic luck, then, is ubiquitous and unavoidable. If all forms of epistemic luck are incompatible with knowledge, as the incompatibility thesis maintains, skepticism is correct and the knowledge thesis is false. And yet, we remain convinced that we possess lots of knowledge. The task facing the anti-skeptical epistemologist is to reconcile the rather strong intuition that epistemic luck is not compatible with knowledge with the equally evident observation that it must be. Since the ubiquity thesis is unassailable, the anti-skeptical epistemologist must reject the incompatibility thesis.

e. Rejecting the Incompatibility Thesis

Peter Unger (1968) was the first epistemologist to note that not all forms of epistemic luck are incompatible with knowledge. He identified the following three types of benign epistemic luck: (1) Propositional luck: It can be entirely accidental that p is true, and S can still know that p. For example, a person who witnesses an automobile accident can certainly know that the accident occurred. (2) Existential luck: For S to know that p, S must exist, and it might be extraordinarily lucky that S exists. If S is the lone survivor of a fiery plane crash, S is lucky to be alive, but S’s existential luck does not preclude her from knowing that she survived the crash. (3) Facultative luck: To know that p, S must possess the cognitive skills requisite for knowledge. Suppose S is shot in the head but the bullet narrowly misses all vital regions of the brain required for conceptual thought and knowledge. S is overwhelmingly lucky that she still possesses the cognitive capacities needed for knowledge, but since she does possess them, she is still capable of knowing many things, including that she was shot in the head.

f. Knowledge-Destroying Epistemic Luck

Unger has successfully identified three types of harmless epistemic luck, but not all forms of epistemic luck are benign. What is needed is an account of knowledge-undermining luck.

i. Evidential vs. Veritic Luck

Mylan Engel Jr. (1992) distinguishes two kinds of epistemic luck, evidential luck and veritic luck, and argues that only the latter is incompatible with knowledge. Engel characterizes these two types of luck as follows:

(EL)     A person S is evidentially lucky in believing that p in circumstances C if and only if it is just a matter of luck that S has the evidence e for p that she does, but given her evidence e, it is not a matter of luck that her belief that p is true in C.

(VL)    A person S is veritically lucky in believing that p in circumstances C if and only if, given S’s evidence for p, it is just a matter of luck that S’s belief that p is true in C.

To see that evidential luck is compatible with knowledge, suppose that a bank robber’s mask slips momentarily during a holdup and the startled teller sees clearly that the robber is the bank president. In such a situation, the teller would clearly be lucky to have the evidence she does, but she would nevertheless know that the bank president is the villain.

Engel argues that all genuine Gettier cases involve veritic luck. In Gettier’s Case II presented above, Smith’s belief that J or B is veritically lucky: Given Smith’s misleading evidence of Jones’s Ford-ownership status and her total lack of evidence concerning Brown’s whereabouts, it is just a matter of luck that Smith’s belief that J or B is true. Veritic luck with respect to p is incompatible with knowing that p, because it undercuts the connection between S’s evidence for p and the truth of p in a way that makes it entirely coincidental from S’s point of view that p is true.

Engel then uses the distinction between evidential and veritic luck to assess Harman cases. Jill is not veritically lucky in believing that the President has been assassinated, for she has accurate, reliable evidence concerning the assassination in the form of a reputable newspaper’s column, and given this evidence, it is not a matter of luck that her belief is true. However, Jill is evidentially lucky—she is lucky to be in the evidential situation that she is in, for had she turned on the TV and seen the fabricated retraction, she would have been in a much worse evidential situation vis-à-vis the President’s assassination. Lucky for her, she did not turn on the TV Like the bank teller above, Jill is lucky to have the evidence she does, but given her evidence, she is not lucky that her belief is true. Having argued that only veritic luck is incompatible with knowledge, Engel concludes that Jill does know the President has been assassinated. If Engel is right, then Harman cases do not provide examples of knowledge-undermining luck.

ii. Justification-Oriented Luck

Hamid Vahid (2001) maintains that there are two types of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck. He agrees with Engel that veritic luck as characterized by VL is incompatible with knowledge, but he argues, contra Engel, that there is a kind of evidential luck (which he dubs ‘justification-oriented luck’) that is also incompatible with knowledge. Vahid contends that knowledge-precluding justification-oriented luck is a function of how easily a person’s belief could have been unjustified:

(JL)      A person suffers from knowledge-precluding justification-oriented luck, when she is justified in believing that p, but given her epistemic circumstances, she could have easily been unjustified in holding that very belief.

Vahid contends that Harman’s Assassination case provides an example of knowledge-precluding justification-oriented luck. Jill could have easily been unjustified in believing that the President was assassinated. Had she turned on the TV like she usually does, she would not have been justified in holding that belief. Vahid concludes that Jill does not know that the President was assassinated—her knowledge is destroyed by justification-oriented luck.

While JL might yield the right result in Harman’s Assassination case, it seems to yield the wrong result with respect to the bank teller case. The teller is justified in believing that the bank president is the robber because she just happened to look up during the brief moment when his mask had slipped and clearly saw the robber’s face, but she could have easily been unjustified in this belief. Had she continued to look in her cash drawer while nervously collecting the cash for the robber, she would not have seen the robber’s face. Clearly, the teller knows that the bank president is the robber, and yet, JL implies that she lacks such knowledge.

iii. Modal Veritic Luck

Duncan Pritchard (2003) agrees that, of these types of luck, only veritic luck is incompatible with knowledge, but he replaces Engel’s evidence-based characterization of veritic luck with the following modal analysis:

(MVL)  For all agents S and propositions p, the truth of S’s belief that p is veritically lucky if and only if S’s belief that p is true in the actual world a but false in nearly all nearby possible worlds in which S forms the belief in the same manner as in a.

MVL differs from VL in the following way: it concerns the connection between the method of belief formation and proposition believed, rather than the connection between S’s evidence and the proposition for which it is evidence. Pritchard argues that a safety-based neo-Moorean account, according to which knowledge is safe true belief, is capable of eliminating veritic luck. In a moment, we will see, contra Pritchard, that safe true belief is incapable of ruling out certain paradigm cases of veritic luck.

g. Second-Wave Anti-Luck Epistemologies

The post-Gettier literature is rife with attempts at supplementing or amending the traditional JTB-analysis with a satisfactory anti-luck constraint on knowledge. As surveyed in Section 1, the first wave of proposals included adding a no-false-grounds or no-essential-false-grounds condition to JTB, supplementing JTB with a defeasibility condition, incorporating an externalistic justification condition in JTB, and replacing JTB with a causal theory of knowing. These and similar proposals have fallen prey to ever-more-complicated Gettier-style examples. The general consensus is that none of these proposals succeeds. Second-wave luck-eliminating proposals invoke counterfactual or subjunctive constraints on knowing, principal among them: sensitivity and safety. Let us consider each of these proposals in turn.

i. Sensitivity

S’s belief that p is sensitive to p’s truth-value if and only if S would not believe that p if p were false (that is, if and only if S does not believe p in any of the closest ~p-worlds). To be sure, sensitive belief does preclude veritic luck, but it does so at a steep price. First, the sensitive-true-belief account of knowledge results in closure failure. Second, there are compelling reasons to think that knowledge does not require sensitivity. Let’s examine each cost in turn.

Most epistemologists regard it as all but axiomatic that we can expand our knowledge by competently deducing some currently unknown proposition u from some other known proposition k whenever we know that k entails u. This widely-embraced idea is codified in the principle of epistemic closure which has been formulated in each of the following ways:

(PEC1)   If S knows that p and S knows that p entails q, then S knows (or is in a position to know) that q.

(PEC2)   If (i) S knows that p, (ii) S knows that p entails q, (iii) S competently deduces q from her knowledge that p and that p entails q, and (iv) S comes to believe q as a result of that competent deduction, then S knows that q.

One reason the principle of epistemic closure has enjoyed such widespread endorsement is this: If I know that p and know that p entails q and I deduce and come to believe q from that knowledge, my belief that q could not be false (because knowledge is factive and the truth of p entails q, together with the truth of p, guarantees the truth of q).

The following example illustrates why sensitive-true-belief accounts of knowledge result in closure failure. I currently believe that I am in a coffee shop [C]. My belief that C is sensitive. If I were not in a coffee shop, I would not believe that I was, for if I were not in a coffee shop, I would be somewhere else, for example, the grocery store or my office, and would not mistakenly think that I was at a coffee shop. Since my belief that C is sensitive (that is, I would not believe it if it were false), the sensitive-true-belief account of knowledge entails that I know that C. I also currently believe that I am not at home in bed having a lifelike dream of being in a coffee shop [~H], but my belief that ~H is not sensitive, for if I were at home in bed having a lifelike dream of being in a coffee shop (that is, if ~H were false), I would still believe that ~H. So, according to the sensitive-true-belief account, I do not know that ~H. Of course, my being at the coffee shop entails that I am not at home in bed dreaming that I am in a coffee shop (that is, C ==> ~H), and I know that C ==> ~H. The sensitive-true-belief account results in closure failure because it entails that I know that C and know that C ==> ~H, but I do not know (and cannot come to know) that ~H on that basis.

Most epistemologists regard the principle of epistemic closure to be so plausible that they find any theory of knowledge that results in closure failure deeply problematic if not outright absurd. In fairness to sensitivity theorists, they recognize that their theories entail closure failure and acknowledge the antecedent implausibility of closure failure, but they argue that, despite its counterintuitiveness, there are principled reasons for thinking that knowledge is not closed under known implication. They grant that we have all sorts of ordinary knowledge, but insist that we do not know and cannot know that the skeptic’s hypotheses are false. Thus, they embrace closure failure because they think that it accurately captures our actual epistemic situation. Perhaps sensitivity theorists are right, but given how widely accepted the principle of epistemic closure is, it would be preferable to identify an anti-luck constraint that avoids closure failure.

The second major problem facing the sensitivity proposal, as Jonathan Vogel (1999) shows with Hole-In-One, is that knowledge does not require sensitivity. The fourth hole at Augusta National Golf Course where The Masters is played is a tricky 240-yard par 3, euphemistically called “Flowering Crabapple.” In 2007, not one player shot a hole-in-one on this diabolical hole, and there were only eleven birdies throughout four rounds of play. Right now, I know that not all seventy-two players in this year’s Masters will shoot a hole-in-one on Flowering Crabapple in the first round of play, but my belief to this effect is not sensitive. Were every golfer to shoot a hole-in-one on Flowering Crabapple in Round One of the Masters in defiance of the astronomical odds against it, I would still believe that they were not going to do so. So, sensitivity is not necessary for knowledge.

ii. Safety

Considerations such as these have led a number of epistemologists (Sosa 1999 & 2000, Williamson 2000a & 2000b, Pritchard 2005) to replace the sensitivity condition with some sort of safety condition. Safety comes in different strengths: S’s true belief that p is strongly safe if and only if were S to believe that p, p would be true (that is, in all the closest worlds where S believes p, p is true). S’s true belief that p is weakly safe if and only if S would not easily be mistaken with respect to p (that is, in the overwhelming majority of nearby worlds where S believes that p, p is true).

Peter Murphy (2005) employs Saul Kripke’s famous counterexample to sensitivity to show that strong safety results in closure failure. Suppose the following is true of Fake Barn County: The landscape is peppered with barn façades, there are a few real barns in the county, some of the real barns are red and some are blue, but all of the façades are red. Driving through Fake Barn County, Mary is unaware that the most of the barn-looking structures are façades. She looks at a blue barn and comes to believe that she is looking at a blue barn. Her belief is safe. In all nearby worlds where she believes she is looking at a blue barn, she is looking at a blue barn, for there are no blue façades. However, her belief that she is looking at a barn is not safe. There are many nearby worlds where she believes she’s looking at a barn, but is really just looking at a façade. So, strong safety entails that Mary knows she’s looking at a blue barn, but does not know she’s looking at a barn.

Weak safety is open to a different worry. If knowledge only requires weakly-safe justified true belief, then a person who justifiably believes her lottery ticket will lose knows that her ticket will lose (unless, of course, it happens to win), because in the overwhelming majority of nearby worlds, her ticket is a loser. Many epistemologists (though not all) insist that people do not know their lottery tickets will lose, prior to hearing the announced results. Anyone convinced that people do not know their tickets will lose, before learning of the results, will think that weak safety is too weak of an anti-luck constraint on knowledge.

Avram Hiller and Ram Neta (2007) convincingly argue that no safe belief condition can eliminate all cases of veritic luck as follows: Start with a justified-but-false-and-unsafe belief like Smith's belief that Jones owns a Ford. Next, have Smith justifiably infer a disjunction of the form J or ~G, where Smith has no evidence whatsoever that ~G is true and where unbeknownst to Smith, ~G is true in all nearby worlds. Let ~G = Brown will not win a Grammy. Suppose that, unbeknownst to Smith, Brown is totally devoid of musical talent and there is no remotely close world where Brown wins a Grammy. Then, Smith's true belief that J or ~G will be safe, but veritically lucky nonetheless, because given Smith’s evidence, it is just a matter of luck that J or ~G is true. Since the safe-true-belief account cannot rule out all cases of veritic luck, safe-true-belief is not sufficient for knowledge.

Hiller and Neta’s example also shows that Pritchard’s modal account of veritic luck [MVL] is not the correct analysis of veritic luck. Smith’s belief that J or ~G is clearly veritically lucky: Smith bases her belief that J or ~G on her justified-but-false-and-unsafe-belief that Jones owns a Ford. Since Smith has absolutely no knowledge or evidence of Brown’s total lack of musical talent, given Smith’s evidence, it is just a matter of luck that her belief that J or ~G is true. But MVL entails that Smith’s belief is not veritically lucky. According to MVL, a belief is veritically lucky if it is true in the actual world but false in nearly all nearby worlds where Smith forms the belief in the same manner. In Hiller and Neta’s case, Smith’s belief that J or ~G is true in the actual world, but it is also true in all nearby worlds where it is formed in the same way (because ~G is true in all nearby worlds). Thus, according to MVL, Smith’s belief that J or ~G is not veritically lucky. Since Smith’s belief is veritically lucky, the MVL analysis of veritic luck is mistaken.

h. Paradox Lost

The paradox of epistemic luck dissolves once we recognize that the incompatibility thesis is false. Not all forms of epistemic luck are incompatible with knowledge. Certainly propositional, existential, and facultative luck are compatible with knowledge, and at least some forms of evidential luck, like the evidential luck had by the bank teller above, are also compatible with knowledge. There is growing consensus that veritic luck is the principal form of knowledge-destroying luck. Since veritic luck is far from ubiquitous, the incompatibility of veritic luck with knowledge poses no general threat to the possibility of knowledge. One can know that p whenever it is not a matter of veritic luck that one’s justified belief that p is true.

3. Epistemic Luck and Knowing that One Knows

Although there remains broad disagreement over how exactly to formulate the condition needed to rule out knowledge-destroying epistemic luck in a theory of knowledge, there is widespread consensus that whatever the correct condition is, S does not need to know that that condition has been met in order to know that p. The point can be illustrated as follows: Let the expression “S is not Gettiered with respect to p” serve as a placeholder for whatever the correct substantive luck-eliminating condition is. If we add this condition to the traditional justified-true-belief analysis, we get the following schema for analyzing knowledge:

(K) S knows that p if and only if:

(i) p is true,

(ii) S believes that p,

(iii) S is justified in believing that p, and

(iv) S is not Gettiered with respect to p.

According to (K), S does not need to know that conditions (i)-(iv) are met in order to know that p. All that (K) requires for S to know that p is that conditions (i)-(iv) be met. Since S need not know or even believe that she is not Gettiered with respect to p in order to know that p, the possibility of Gettier-style, knowledge-destroying, veritic luck poses no special obstacle to first-order knowledge (where ‘first-order knowledge’ refers to knowing that p and ‘second-order knowledge’ refers to knowing that one knows that p). As long as S is not veritically lucky with respect to p, she will know that p, according to schema (K), provided she has a justified true belief that p.

The situation seems to be quite different when it comes to knowing that one knows, for one of the most natural ways of coming to know that one knows that p is by knowing that one has met the conditions required for knowing that p, and knowing the latter requires knowing that one is not Gettiered with respect to p. The burden of the present section is to examine whether the phenomenon of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck undermines more reflective forms of knowledge, such as, knowing that one knows.

a. Internalism, Epistemic Luck, and the Problem of Knowing that One Knows

Arch internalist H.A. Pritchard (1950) famously remarked: “We must recognize that whenever we know something we either do, or at least can, by reflecting, directly know that we are knowing it.” Other internalists have been less sanguine about the prospects of second-order knowledge. For example, Roderick Chisholm (1986) argues that one cannot generally know that one knows on the grounds that one cannot generally know whether or not one’s evidence for p is defeated by Gettier considerations. Is Chisholm right? Does the Gettier problem pose special—indeed, generally insurmountable—obstacles to internalistically knowing that one internalistically knows that p? Richard Feldman (1981) does not think so. He thinks that the Gettier problem poses a minor obstacle to second-order knowledge, but one that can be easily overcome with minimal intellectual effort. Mylan Engel Jr. (2000) disagrees. Siding with Chisholm, Engel argues that the Gettier problem poses three distinct challenges to second-order knowledge, which, when taken together, threaten to undermine the possibility of knowing that one knows. Michael Roth (1990) contends that the Gettier problem poses no threat to second-order knowledge whatsoever. To assess these competing views, it will be helpful to have a clearer idea of just what is required for internalistic knowledge.

Post-Gettier internalists with respect to knowledge tend to work within the JTB+ tradition in that they maintain that, in addition to true belief, knowledge requires internalistic justification as well as some fourth externalistic anti-luck condition to rule out Gettier cases. Accordingly, by replacing condition (iii) in schema (K) above with an explicitly internalistic justification condition, we arrive at a schema for internalistic knowledge that most internalists would readily embrace:

(Ki)      S internalistically knows (knowsi) that p if and only if:

(k1) p is true,

(k2) S believes that p,

(k3) S is internalistically justified (justifiedi) in believing that p, and

(k4) S is not Gettiered with respect to p.

Since (Ki) provides a perfectly general account of knowledgei, we can arrive at the conditions for second-order knowledgei simply by substituting S knowsi that p for p in schema (Ki):

(KiKi) S knowsi that S knowsi that p if and only if:

(kk1) S knowsi that p is true,

(kk2) S believes that S knowsi that p,

(kk3) S is justifiedi in believing that S knowsi that p, and

(kk4) S is not Gettiered with respect to S knowsi that p.

Chisholm doubts that (kk3) can be satisfied. To appreciate Chisholm’s worry, consider one of the most natural and straightforward ways of satisfying condition (kk3), namely, being justifiedi in believing that one has met all of the conditions required for knowingi that p:

(JiKip)    S is justifiedi­­ in believing that S knowsi that p if and only if:

(jk1) S is justifiedi­­ in believing that p,

(jk2) S is justifiedi­­ in believing that S believes that p,

(jk3) S is justifiedi­­ in believing that S is justifiedi in believing that p, and

(jk4) S is justifiedi­­ in believing that S is not Gettiered with respect to p.

Since (jk1) is identical to (k3), (jk1) is satisfied whenever S knowsi that p; and if we assume both doxastic and justificationali transparency (that is, if we assume that we have introspective access to what we believe and to our justificationi for what we believe), as do many internalists, then (jk2) and (jk3) also pose no special problems for the would-be second-order knower.

Chisholm’s concern is with (jk4). He contends that we cannot typically tell whether or not our evidence for p is defeated by Gettier considerations. Based on this contention, Chisholm argues as follows: Let S be any one of us and let p be a proposition that S knowsi. Since S cannot tell whether S’s evidence for p is defeated by Gettier considerations, S is not justifiedi in believing that S is not Gettiered with respect to p. Hence, (jk4) is not satisfied. Since (jk4) is not satisfied, S is not justifiedi­ in believing that S knowsi that p, that is, (kk3) is not satisfied. Since (kk3) is a necessary condition for knowingi that one knowsi that p, S does not knowi­ that S knowsi that p. The gist of Chisholm’s argument is this: Since we are not justifiedi in believing that we are not Gettiered with respect to p, we do not knowi that we knowi that p.

Feldman disagrees. He thinks that, with minimal effort, a person who knowsi that p can be justifiedi in believing that she is not Gettiered with respect to p. Feldman offers two reasons for thinking that it is relatively easy to be justifiedi in believing that one’s evidence for p is not defective and thus that one is not Gettiered with respect to p. Since Feldman is primarily concerned with determining when a person who knowsi that p knowsi that she knowsi that p, he assumes that S has first-order knowledgei that p when presenting his reasons.

No False Evidence

Assume that S knowsi that p. S’s knowingi that p entails that S is justifiedi in believing that p. Since S is justifiedi in believing that p, S is also justified­i­ in believing that all of her evidence for p is true. Since false evidence is usually what makes one’s evidence defective, S is justified in believing that her justificationi for p is not defective and thus that she is not Gettiered with respect to p.

Induction

Since S has very rarely found herself to be the victim of Gettier-type situations, she is justifiedi in believing that such situations are very rare and atypical. Given their rarity and atypicality, S is justifiedi in believing that she is not is such a situation with respect to p.

Feldman contends that No False Evidence and Induction provide S with good internalistic reasons for believing that she is not Gettiered with respect to p. Since internalistic justification is a function of having good internalistic reasons and S has good internalistic reasons for believing that she is not Gettiered with respect to p, S is justifiedi in believing that she is not Gettiered with respect to p, that is, (jk4) is satisfied. Since (jk1)-(jk3) are also easily satisfiable, with minimal intellectual effort, S can be justifiedi in believing that she knowsi that p. Feldman concludes that satisfying (kk3) poses no special obstacle to knowingi that one knowsi.

Engel contends that the Gettier problem generates three distinct challenges for the would-be second-order knower—challenges that threaten to undermine the satisfaction of (kk1), (kk3), and (kk4), respectively:

(1) First-order actual Gettierization: One way the Gettier problem can preclude S from knowingi that she knowsi that p is by preventing S from knowingi that p. If S is Gettiered with respect to p, then S fails to knowi that p, and thus, she fails to knowi that she knows that p, since (kk1) is unsatisfied. However, since first-order actual Gettierization precludes second-order knowledgei only when it obtains, it poses no greater threat to second-order knowledgei than it poses to first-order knowledgei.

(2) First-order possible (but non-actual) Gettierization: While actual first-order Gettierization, when it obtains, undermines second-order knowledgei by falsifying (kk1), possible (but non-actual) first-order Gettierization threatens to thwart one of the most natural ways of satisfying (kk3), namely, satisfying conditions (jk1)-(jk4) of JiKip. Like Chisholm, Engel’s concern here is with (jk4). He argues that the reasons Feldman offersNo False Evidence and Inductiondo not provide adequate reasons for thinking that one is not Gettiered with respect to p. No False Evidence is not a good reason to think that one has not been Gettiered with respect to p because, as noted in Section 1, there can be all-true-evidence Gettier cases, a point that Feldman himself demonstrated in an earlier article (Feldman, 1974). While No False Evidence may provide S with a reason for thinking that she is not the victim of a Gettier case involving a justified-false-belief, it provides her with no reason to think that she is not the victim of an all-true-evidence Gettier case. The problem with Induction is that many of the Gettier cases described in the literature are what we might call “invisible” Gettier cases, that is, they are cases such that, were they to obtain, the Gettier victim would never find out. They are cases that look and feel like knowledge and pass away unnoticed. Unless Pyromaniac Pete is wearing a Geiger counter, he will never discover that it was Q-radiation and not striking friction that caused his defective Sure Fire match to light. Unless John Lock interrogates Lucy Lock about her morning routine, he will likely never discover that she unlocked the doors to their house at 10:30 a.m. Unless Henry leaves the highway and investigates, he will likely never discover that most of the barn-looking structures are façades. Considerations such as these make it plausible to think that invisible Gettier cases are more likely to be the norm than visible Gettier cases. The fact that S has rarely found herself to be Gettiered in the past may provider her with a reason for thinking that visible Gettier cases are rare, but it provides her no reason to think that invisible Gettier cases are rare, and without such a reason, she is not justified­i in believing that she is not being (invisibly) Gettiered with respect to p. Engel concludes that it is much more difficult to be justifiedi in believing that one is not Gettiered with respect to p than Feldman alleges.

(3) Meta-Gettierization: Engel dubs second-order Gettierization “meta-Gettierization.” Just as first-order Gettierization occurs when S’s justification for p is defective in a way that makes S veritically lucky with respect to p, meta-Gettierization occurs when S’s justification for believing that S knowsi that p is defective in a way that makes S veritically lucky with respect to S knowsi that p. By way of illustration, Engel asks us to consider Professor Cleaver, a fictitious philosophy professor from the 1950s, who, as a pre-Gettier epistemologist, justifiably accepts the JTB-analysis of knowledge. Since Cleaver is justifiedi in believing that knowledgei is justifiedi true belief, he is justifiedi in believing that (jk1)-(jk3) are jointly sufficient for being justifiedi in believing that one knowsi that p. Since he is justifiedi in believing that (jk1)-(jk3) are jointly sufficient for being justifiedi in believing that one knowsi that p, he is justifiedi in believing that he knowsi that p provided that he is justifiedi in believing that he has justifiedi-true-belief that p. Let p be a proposition that Cleaver knowsi. If he believes that he knowsi that p, and if he is justifiedi in believing that he knowsi that p on the basis of his justifiedi-but-false-belief that knowledgei is justifiedi true belief, together with his justifiedi-true-belief that he has a justifiedi-true-belief that p, then Cleaver will have a justifiedi-true-belief that he knowsi that p, which falls short of knowledgei because his justificationi essentially depends on his justifiedi-but-false-belief that knowledgei is justifiedi true belief. The point generalizes. Anytime that Cleaver comes to believe that he knowsi that p on the basis of his justifiedi-but-false-belief that the JTB-analysis is correct, he will automatically be meta-Gettierized and will, thus, fail to knowi that he knowsi that p. Engel then argues that whether those of us who have grown up in the post-Gettier enlightenment can avoid Cleaver’s fate depends on whether any of us justifiedly­i believes a true epistemology. Since no epistemology to date is immune to objection, Engel thinks it doubtful that any of us holds a true epistemology (no matter how well justifiedi we might be in our preferred epistemology). Given how likely it is that we are operating with a false epistemology, Engel contends that whenever we come to believe that we knowi that p on the basis of our preferred epistemology, we are almost certain to become yet another meta-Gettier casualty, for we are almost certain to have based our belief that we ­­knowi that p on a justifiedi false belief about the requirements for knowledgei.

Roth contends that the debate over whether the Gettier problem poses a major or minor obstacle to second-order knowledgei is entirely misguided. He argues that Gettier considerations pose no obstacle to second-order knowledgei whatsoever. His argument is rooted in what he calls the Fallibilist Assumption Governing Empirical Knowledge:

(FA)    For every proposition of the form Kp (where p is empirical and K is the knowledge operator), there are certain contingencies such that: (i) their obtaining is physically possible, (ii) were they to obtain, Kp would be false, and (iii) S is completely justified in disregarding any of these contingencies in considering whether she has adequate justification for p.

Roth contends that there are two types of Kp-falsifying contingencies. “Type I contingencies” satisfy conditions (i), (ii), and (iii) of (FA). “Type II contingencies” satisfy conditions (i) and (ii), but not (iii). Roth asks us to imagine a great dividing wall – The Wall of Fallibilism – that separates the Type I contingencies from the Type II contingencies. As Roth envisions it, the Wall of Fallibilism plays an important role in protecting us from knowledge-destroying epistemic luck. If, given S’s evidence for p in circumstances C, it is simply a matter of luck that p is true in C, then S does not know that p in C. To ensure that it is not just a matter of veritic luck that S’s belief that p is true (in C), S must be suitably protected from error with respect to p (in C). According to Roth, the Wall protects us from the slings and arrows of outrageous Type I error possibilities by cordoning us off from these remote properly ignorable Kp-falsifying contingencies. We do not need evidence that these contingencies do not obtain in order to knowi that p. Being safely outside the Wall, we do not need to take them into account in our epistemic reflections at all. Their sheer remoteness and improbability protects us from having to worry about them. As long as they do not actually obtain, these contingencies provide no obstacle to knowledgei whatsoever. But the Wall does not provide us with all the protection from luck and error that we need in order to possess knowledgei. We must also be protected from error with respect to those Type II contingencies that are inside the Wall. These p-falsifying contingencies are genuinely in doubt. Were any of these contingencies to obtain, p would be false, and as a result, so too would Kp. To protect us from these realistic non-ignorable ~p-possibilities, we need justification that precludes them. The picture of fallible knowledgei that emerges is this:

S knowsi that p only if (i) S’s justificationi is strong enough to rule out all of the relevant Type II ~p-possibilities inside the Wall and (ii) none of the Type I contingencies outside the Wall obtain.

Roth thinks that the Wall metaphor explains why Gettier considerations pose no obstacle to second-order knowledgei­­. Gettier considerations are paradigm cases of Type I contingencies. We do not need to knowi or even believe that Type I contingencies do not obtain in order to knowi that p. As long as no Type I contingencies obtain, S will knowi that p provided she satisfies the other conditions required for knowingi that p. Like Type I contingencies generally, Gettier considerations only undermine knowledgei when they obtain. We do not need to knowi or even believe that no Gettier circumstances obtain in order to knowi that p. As long as they do not obtain, we will knowi that p provided we have met the other conditions required for knowingi that p. Since Gettier contingencies are outside the Wall, Roth contends that it is perfectly proper to ignore them when trying to determine whether one knowsi that p.

Roth’s reason for thinking that Gettier contingencies pose no obstacle to knowingi that one knowsi is that he thinks that Gettier possibilities are properly ignorable Type I contingencies that lie safely outside the Wall. The problem with Roth’s argument is that the Wall’s location is not fixed. As Roth himself admits, where the Wall is situated is relativized to a particular attempt to acquire knowledgei of a particular proposition. Which contingencies are outside the Wall and which are not, that is, which contingencies are properly ignorable and which are not, is a function of the proposition one is attempting to come to knowi and the circumstances under which one is trying to come to knowi it. While Gettier contingencies vis-à-vis p are clearly properly ignorable where coming to knowi that p is concerned, they are not properly-ignorable when it comes to knowingi that Kp. To the contrary, it seems that Kp-destroying Gettier contingencies are precisely the kind of contingencies that one needs to be able to rule out in order to know that one knows that p. Gettier contingencies are not p-falsifying contingencies (for p is true in Gettier situations), but they are Kp-falsifying contingencies. As such, they are Type I contingencies when it comes to knowingi that p, but Type II contingencies when it comes to knowingi that one knowsi that p. In effect, the Wall moves outward where second-order knowledgei is concerned. The very same Gettier contingencies that are outside the p-Wall are inside the Kp-Wall. Being inside the Kp-Wall, they are not properly ignorable when it comes to knowingi that Kp. To knowi that one knowsi that p, one must knowi that no Gettier Kp-falsifying contingencies obtain. It is precisely because we cannot generally knowi that no Gettier contingencies obtain that Chisholm and Engel contend that second-order knowledgei is difficult to attain.

b. Epistemic Luck and Reflective Knowledge

Even if veritic luck poses no special problem for reflectively knowing that one knows, Duncan Pritchard contends that another more worrisome kind of epistemic luck does preclude such knowledge. Reflective epistemic luck arises when, from the agent’s reflective position, it is just a matter of luck that her belief is true. More precisely:

MRL   For all S and p, the truth of S’s belief that p is reflectively lucky if and only if S’s belief that p is true in the actual world but, in nearly all nearby possible worlds consistent with what S is able to know by reflection alone, were S to believe p, p would be false.

When it comes to modal reflective luck, the epistemically relevant possible worlds are ordered in a non-standard way solely in terms of what the agent is able to know on the basis of her subjective internal reflections alone. Accordingly, any possible world consistent with S’s having that same internally accessible evidence that she has in the actual world will be reflectively equally close to the actual world. Since, by hypothesis, S would have exactly the same internally accessible evidence in a demon world or a BIV-world that she has in the actual world, these worlds are just as close, reflectively, to the actual world as is the world where everything is just as it seems. Since our ordinary commonsense perceptual beliefs are false in a wide variety of these reflectively equally close skeptical-scenario possible worlds, Pritchard maintains that MRL entails that our ordinary commonsense perceptual beliefsif true in the actual worldare reflectively lucky. [Whether MRL actually entails that all of our true commonsense perceptual beliefs are reflectively lucky is by no means obvious. The fact that our commonsense beliefs are false in malevolent demon and BIV worlds does not show that these beliefs are false in nearly all reflectively equally close possible worlds. After all, for every malevolent demon world where we are systematically deceived, there is a corresponding benevolent demon world that is just as close, reflectively, in which the benevolent demon sees to it that all of our commonsense beliefs are true.]

Pritchard thinks that reflective luck is not incompatible with ordinary knowledge (he thinks only veritic luck is), but he insists that reflective luck is incompatible with a much-desired internalistic kind of robust reflective knowledge. Pritchard contends that skeptical challenges force us to confront the fundamental human epistemic predicament, to wit, that we cannot know, on the basis of reflection alone, that the skeptic’s radical hypotheses are false. For example, he thinks that we cannot know, by reflection alone, that we are not bodiless brains being kept alive in vats of nutrient being deceived into thinking we have hands.

If Pritchard is right that we lack reflective knowledge that the skeptic’s hypotheses are false, then those who think that reflective knowledge is closed under known entailment face an even greater skeptical threat. According to the principle of epistemic closure (PEC1): If S knows that p and also knows that p entails q, then S either knows or is in a position to know that q. Since we know that having hands entails not being a deceived bodiless brain in a vat, if we cannot have reflective knowledge that we are not deceived bodiless brains in vats, then given PEC1, we cannot have reflective knowledge that we have hands. The point can, of course, be generalized. Since radical skeptical hypotheses are incompatible with virtually all of the ordinary propositions we routinely take ourselves to know, if we lack reflective knowledge that radical skeptical hypotheses are false, then we lack reflective knowledge of the most mundane of ordinary propositions.

Pritchard contends that skeptical challenges force us to recognize the reflectively lucky nature of our anti-skeptical beliefs and that this, in turn, explains the enduring epistemic angst that skeptical hypotheses engender. Pritchard argues that the ineliminability of reflective luck shows that we not only lack reflective knowledge that the skeptic’s hypotheses are false, we also lack reflective knowledge that our ordinary commonsense beliefs are true. If Pritchard is right, we may, indeed, possess a great deal of ordinary knowledge, but the ineliminability of reflective luck will forever preclude us from reflectively being able to tell that we do.

4. Conclusion

Reflecting on the nature and scope of epistemic luck gives us deeper insight into the nature and scope of knowledge. Gettier cases demonstrate that fallible justification is not capable of ruling out all forms of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck and that thus knowledge requires more than justified true belief. Just what anti-luck condition must be added justified true belief to arrive at an adequate analysis of knowledge remains an open question.

Recognizing which forms of epistemic luck are incompatible with knowledge and which are not puts us one step closer to identifying the correct luck-eliminating condition. It is now generally acknowledged that veritic luck is incompatible with knowledge. Whether other forms of epistemic luck, such as, justification-oriented luck, are incompatible with knowledge is a question that deserves more attention. At a minimum, any adequate theory of knowledge must be capable of ruling out all cases of veritic luck and to date no theory has been able to do so.

The possibility of knowledge-destroying veritic luck poses no special skeptical threat where first-order knowledge is concerned. As long as a person is not veritically lucky with respect to p, she will know that p, provided she has met the other conditions required for knowledge. The situation appears to be different where second-order knowledge is concerned. While there is no consensus to date as to how serious an obstacle the Gettier problem poses for second-order knowledge, it poses enough of an obstacle to such knowledge to render implausible the once widely held KK-thesis according to which knowing entails knowing that one knows.

Veritic luck is not the only form of epistemic luck that threatens more reflective forms of knowledge. Reflective luck also threatens to undermine the possibility of reflectively knowing that one knows. Our apparent inability to know, on the basis of reflection alone, that the skeptic’s radical hypotheses are false, together with the principle of  epistemic closure, threatens to undermine the possibility of reflective knowledge altogether.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Chisholm, Roderick. 1986. “The Place of Epistemic Justification.” Philosophical Topics 14: 85-92.
    • Argues that one cannot generally know that one knows on the grounds that one cannot generally know whether or not one’s evidence for p is defeated by Gettier considerations.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. 1964. “The Ethics of Requirement.” American Philosophical Quarterly 1: 147-153.
    • Provides a No Defeaters response to the Gettier problem.
  • Clarke, Michael. 1963. “Knowledge and Grounds: A Comment on Mr. Gettier’s Paper.” Analysis XXIV: 46-48.
    • Argues that No False Grounds is mistaken since S can derive a justified true belief that p from a justified true belief that q and still fail to know that p because S’s grounds for q are false. Contends that knowledge is “fully grounded” justified true belief, where in order to be fully grounded, the chain of reasons leading up to S’s proximate grounds for p must itself contain no false grounds at any point in the chain.
  • Coffman, E.J. 2007. “Thinking about Luck.” Synthese 158: 385-398.
    • Defends a lack of control account of luck.
  • Dretske, Fred. 1971. “Conclusive Reasons.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 49: 1-22.
    • Argues that in order to rule out knowledge-destroying luck, one’s reasons for p must be conclusive in the sense that one would not have had those reasons if p were false.
  • Engel Jr., Mylan. 2000. “Internalism, the Gettier Problem, and Metaepistemological Skepticism.” Grazer Philosophische Studien 60: 99-117.
    • Argues that the Gettier problem poses three distinct challenges to second-order knowledge which, when taken together, threaten to undermine the possibility of knowing that one knows.
  • Engel Jr., Mylan. 1992. “Is Epistemic Luck Compatible with Knowledge?” Southern Journal of Philosophy 30: 59-75.
    • Identifies veritic luck as the principal form of knowledge-destroying luck. Distinguishes veritic luck from evidential luck. Argues that, of these two types of luck, only veritic luck is incompatible with knowledge. Further argues that only externalist epistemologies are capable of ruling out veritic luck.
  • Feldman, Richard. 1981. “Fallibilism and Knowing that One Knows.” Philosophical Review XC: 266-282.
    • Defends the iterative KK-thesis. Argues that the Gettier problem poses a minor, but hardly insurmountable, obstacle to second-order knowledge.
  • Feldman, Richard. 1974. “An Alleged Defect in Gettier Counterexamples.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 52: 68-69.
    • Provides a decisive example of an all-true-evidence Gettier case that shows that No False Grounds is too weak.
  • Fumerton, Richard. 1995. Metaepistemology and Skepticism. Lanham, MA: Rowman and Littlefield Publishers.
    • Argues that second-order knowledge is too easy on externalistic accounts of knowledge and that, therefore, such accounts fail to capture the kind of knowledge that interests us.
  • Gettier, Edmund. 1963. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis 23: 121-3.
    • Demonstrates that justified true belief is not sufficient for knowledge. Highlights two paradigm examples of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck.
  • Greco, John. 2004. “A Different Sort of Contextualism. Erkenntnis 61: 383-400.
    • Defends a contextualist virtue epistemology. Offers a situationalist account of veritic luck, that is, an account tied to one’s epistemic situation rather than to one’s evidence: S is veritically lucky in believing that p if and only if, given S’s epistemic situation, it is just a matter of luck that S’s belief that p is true.
  • Greco, John. 2003. “Virtue and Luck, Epistemic and Otherwise.” Metaphilosophy 34: 353-366.
    • Defends a virtue theoretic solution to the Gettier problem. Argues that when S has a true belief that p because S believes out of intellectual virtue (that is, when S’s believing out of intellectual virtue is what accounts for her have a true belief that p rather than a false belief or no belief), then S’s true belief that p is not veritically lucky.
  • Goldman, Alvin. 1979. “What Is Justified Belief?” In Justification and Knowledge. Ed. George Pappas. Dordrecht, Holland: D. Reidel Publishing Company.
    • Develops and defends an externalistic, process reliabilist account of justified belief.
  • Goldman, Alvin. 1967. “A Causal Theory of Knowing.” The Journal of Philosophy 64: 355-372.
    • Attempts to solve the Gettier problem by replacing the traditional justification condition with a causal constraint requiring that one’s belief that p be caused by the fact that makes p true.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1973. Thought. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • Presents three much-discussed examples intended to show that knowledge can be undermined by readily available misleading evidence that one does not possess. Defends a No Essential False Grounds response to the Gettier problem.
  • Harper, William. 1996. “Knowledge and Luck.” Southern Journal of Philosophy 34: 273-283.
    • Demonstrates that the Gettier problem plagues all fallibilistic theories of justification, both internalistic and externalistic alike. Argues that in addition to the traditional justification, truth, and belief conditions, an adequate analysis of knowledge must incorporate a “no luck” condition.
  • Heller, Mark. 1999. “The Proper Role for Contextualism in an Anti-Luck Epistemology.” Philosophical Perspectives, 13, Epistemology: 115-29.
    • Proposes a context-sensitive modal account of epistemic luck according to which ‘S’s belief that p is epistemically lucky’ is true if and only if there is at least one world (in a contextually-determined set of epistemically relevant worlds) where S’s belief that p is false. Defends a contextualist anti-luck epistemology which maintains that ‘S knows that p’ is true if and only if there is no world (in a contextually-determined set of epistemically relevant worlds) where S’s belief that p is false.
  • Hetherington, Stephen. 2005. “Gettier Problems.” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • Canvasses various purported solutions to the Gettier problem. Concludes with the contentious suggestion that justified true belief is sufficient for knowledge and that veritically-lucky justified true beliefs, like those in Gettier’s original examples, are actually cases of knowledge.
  • Hiller, Avram and Ram Neta. 2007. “Safety and Epistemic Luck.” Synthese 158: 303-13.
    • Demonstrates that safe true belief is not sufficient for knowledge by providing an example of a veritically lucky safe true belief that clearly falls short of knowledge.
  • Klein, Peter. 2008. “Useful False Beliefs.” In Epistemology: New Essays. Ed. Quentin Smith. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Argues that there can be beneficial falsehoods—falsehoods essential to one’s justification—that nevertheless give one knowledge.
  • Klein, Peter. 1971. “A Proposed Definition of Propositional Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy 68: 471-482.
    • Defends a No Defeaters solution to the Gettier problem.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2007. “Why We Don’t Deserve Credit for Everything We Know.” Synthese 158: 345-361.
    • Argues that knowledge is not credit-worthy true belief and that thus virtue theoretic accounts of knowledge are mistaken.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2006. “Pritchard’s Epistemic Luck.” The Philosophical Quarterly 56: 284-289.
    • Provides a counterexample to Pritchard’s modal account of luck.
  • Lehrer, Keith. 1990. Theory of Knowledge. Boulder, CO: Westview Press.
    • Defends a coherence theory of justification. Argues that knowledge is undefeated justified true acceptance.
  • Lehrer, Keith and Thomas Paxson Jr. 1969. “Knowledge: Undefeated Justified True Belief.” The Journal of Philosophy 66: 225-237.
    • Defends an alternative No Defeaters response to the Gettier problem. Introduces the Tom Grabit counterexample to the Chisholm/Klein account of defeaters.
  • Lycan, William. 1977. “Evidence One Does Not Possess.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 55: 114-26.
    • Argues that misleading evidence one does not possess does not undermine one’s knowledge and that, thus, Harman Cases are actually cases of knowledge.
  • Murphy, Peter. 2005. “Closure Failure for Safety.” Philosophia 33: 331-34.
    • Adapts Kripke’s famous “blue barn” counterexample to Nozick’s analysis of knowledge to show that safe true belief accounts of knowledge also result in closure failure.
  • Myers, Robert G. and Kenneth Stern. 1973. “Knowledge without Paradox.” Journal of Philosophy 70: 147-160.
    • Argues that p can justify S in believing some other proposition q only if p is true and that, thus, Gettier’s original cases do not provide examples of justified true beliefs that fall short of knowledge.
  • Nozick, Robert. 1981. “Knowledge and Skepticism.” In Philosophical Explanations. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Develops and defends a sensitivity-based subjunctive conditionals analysis of knowledge.
  • Plato: Theaetetus in Plato: Collected Dialogues. Eds. E. Hamilton and H. Cairns. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1961.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. 2005. Epistemic Luck. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Proposes a modal account of veritic luck. Argues that safety precludes veritic luck. Defends an externalist neo-Moorean safe true belief account of ordinary knowledge. Concedes to the skeptic that reflective luck is ineliminable and that such luck is incompatible with reflective knowledge.
  • Pritchard, Duncan. 2003. “Virtue Epistemology and Epistemic Luck.” Metaphilosophy 34: 106-30.
  • Pritchard, H.A. 1950. Knowledge and Perception. Oxford: The Clarendon Press.
  • Riggs, Wayne. 2007. “Why Epistemologists Are So Down on their Luck.” Synthese 158: 329-344.
    • Defends a lack of control account of luck. Argues that knowledge is credit-worthy true belief.
  • Roth, Michael. 1990. “The Wall and the Shield: K-K Reconsidered.” Philosophical Studies 59: 147-157.
    • Argues that the Gettier problem poses no obstacle to second-order knowledge on the grounds that Gettier-type contingencies lie safely outside the wall of fallibilism and can simply be ignored (unless they actually obtain).
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1912. The Problems of Philosophy. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
  • Skyrms, Brian. 1967. “The Explication of ‘X Knows that p’.” Journal of Philosophy 64: 373-389.
    • Provides one of the first cases of an all true evidence Gettier case.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2007. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume 1. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
    • Develops and defends a virtue epistemology which maintains that knowledge is reliably-produced safe true belief, the correctness of which is attributable to one’s epistemic competence. Argues that when the correctness of a reliably-produced safe belief is attributable to the proper exercise of an epistemic competence, then the resultant belief is not epistemically lucky.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 2000. “Skepticism and Contextualism.” Philosophical Issues, 10, Skepticism: 1-18.
    • Defends a non-contextualist safety-based Moorean response to the skeptical paradox.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1999. “How to Defeat Opposition to Moore.” Philosophical Perspectives, 13, Epistemology: 141-54.
    • Develops a safety-based Moorean response to the skeptical paradox. Argues that such a response is preferable to skeptical, tracking, relevant-alternative, and contextualist accounts.
  • Steup, Matthias. 2006. “The Analysis of Knowledge.” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
    • Discusses the necessary conditions for knowledge. Examines internalistic and externalistic analyses of knowledge.
  • Swain, Marshall. 1981. Reasons and Knowledge. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Truncellito, David A. 2007. “Epistemology,” Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Unger, Peter. 1968. “An Analysis of Factual Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy 65: 157-70.
    • Shows that various forms of epistemic luck – including propositional luck, existential luck, and facultative luck – are compatible with knowledge. Argues that knowledge is non-accidentally true belief.
  • Vahid, Hamid. 2001. “Knowledge and Varieties of Epistemic Luck.” Dialectica 55: 351-362.
    • Argues that truth-oriented veritic luck and justification-oriented luck are both incompatible with knowledge.
  • Vogel, Jonathan. 1999. “The New Relevant Alternatives Theory.” Philosophical Perspectives, 13, Epistemology: 155-80.
    • Uses Hole-in-One to argue that sensitivity is not necessary for knowledge.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2000a. “Scepticism and Evidence.” Philosophy and Phenomenal Research 60: 613-28.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2000b. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford, England: Oxford University Press.
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 1996. Virtues of the Mind. Cambridge, England: Cambridge University Press.
    • Characterizes Gettier-style knowledge-destroying luck as cases of “double luck” where epistemic bad luck is cancelled out by epistemic good luck. Argues that no fallibilist epistemology can rule out knowledge-destroying luck. Defends a virtue-based epistemology according to which knowledge is a state of cognitive contact with reality arising out of acts of intellectual virtue, and argues that this definition of knowledge is immune to the Gettier problem because truth is entailed by the other components of the definition.

 

Author Information

Mylan Engel Jr.
Email: mylan-engel@niu.edu
Northern Illinois University
U. S. A.

The Safety Condition for Knowledge

A number of epistemologists have defended a necessary condition for knowledge that has come to be labeled as the “safety” condition. Timothy Williamson, Duncan Pritchard, and Ernest Sosa are the foremost defenders of safety. According to these authors an agent S knows a true proposition P only if S could not easily have falsely believed P. Disagreement arises, however, with respect to how they capture the notion of a safe belief.

Unlike Pritchard and Sosa, who have gone on to incorporate the safety condition into a virtue account of knowledge, Williamson distances himself from the project of offering reductive analyses of knowledge. Williamson’s project can best be thought of as an illumination of the structural features of knowledge by way of safety. The maneuvers of Pritchard and Sosa into the domain of virtue epistemology are not discussed here.

This article is a treatment of the different presentations and defenses of the safety condition for knowledge. Special attention is first paid to an elucidation of the various aspects or features of the safety condition. Following a short demonstration, of the manner in which the safety condition handles some rather tough Gettier-like cases in the literature, some problems facing safety conclude this article.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background
  2. The Safety Condition as a Necessary Condition for Knowledge
    1. Timothy Williamson
    2. Duncan Pritchard
    3. Ernest Sosa
  3. Elucidating the Safety Condition
    1. What Counts as a Close World?
      1. The Time Factor
      2. What Type of Reliability does Safety Require?
      3. Methods
      4. Skepticism
    2. How do the Safety and Sensitivity Conditions Differ?
    3. The Semantics of Safety
  4. Safety in Action
    1. Gettier and Chisholm
    2. Fake Barns
    3. Matches
  5. Problems for Safety
    1. Knowledge of Necessarily True Propositions
    2. Knowledge of the Future
      1. Williamson’s Response
      2. Pritchard’s Response
    3. Safety and Determinism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background

Knowledge is incompatible with accidentally true belief. That is to say, if an agent S is lucky that her belief P is true, S does not know P. This feature of knowledge was made explicit by Bertrand Russell (1948: 170) and, more famously, by Edmund Gettier (1963) who demonstrated that a justified true belief (JTB) is insufficient for knowledge. Gettier provided us with cases in which there is strong intuitive pull towards the judgment that S can have a justified true belief P yet not know P because S is lucky that S’s belief P is true. To use Russell’s case, suppose S truly believes it’s noon as a result of looking at a clock that correctly reads noon. However, unbeknownst to S this clock broke exactly twelve hours prior. Even though S has good reasons to believe it’s noon and S’s belief is true, S does not know it’s noon since S is lucky that her belief is true.

Several notable attempts were made to improve the JTB analysis of knowledge; in particular, some were attracted to the idea that a stronger justification condition would resolve Gettier problems (Shope 1983: 45-108). Thus began the vast literature on the nature of epistemic justification. Others, though disagreeing among themselves about the place of justification in an account of knowledge, sought a solution to the Gettier problem in a new anti-luck condition for knowledge. (The majority of these accounts dropped the justification requirement.) One of these attempts is particularly relevant here. Fred Dretske (1970) and Robert Nozick (1981) proposed accounts of knowledge central to which were a  counterfactual condition, Nozick’s being the more popular of the two. Nozick proposed the following counterfactual as a necessary condition for knowledge (1981: 179): S knows P via a method M only if, were P false, S would not believe P via MP ☐→ ¬B(P)]. This came to be termed the sensitivity condition for knowledge. To satisfy this condition it must be the case that in the closest world in which P is false S does not believe P. That is, S must track the truth of P to know P (where possible worlds are ordered as per their similarity to the actual world).

Nozick’s account enjoyed widespread popularity because of its anti-skeptical capabilities. Following Nozick, I count as knowing that there is tree in my garden since I would not believe that if none were planted there, that is, in the closest world in which there is no tree in my garden (for example, when none is planted there), I do not believe that there is a tree in my garden. Worlds where radically skeptical scenarios are true count as further off since those worlds are more dissimilar to the actual world than the world in which no tree is planted in my garden. That I would believe falsely in those worlds is thus irrelevant. In other words, that I would falsely believe in such a far off world is inconsequential to whether I believe truly in the actual world.

Nozick’s account came with two significant costs, however. Firstly, it cannot accommodate the very intuitive principle that knowledge is closed under known entailment. Roughly, this principle states that if S knows P and S knows that P entails Q then S knows Q. It follows, then, that if I know that I have hands, and I know that if I have hands entails that I am not a handless brain in the vat, then I know that I am not a handless brain in the vat. However, I fail to know that I am not a handless brain in the vat since I would falsely believe I was not a handless brain in the vat in the closest world in which the proposition “I am not a handless brain in the vat” is false (that is, the world in which I am a handless brain in the vat). In other words, the sensitivity condition for knowledge cannot be satisfied when it comes to the denial of radically skeptical hypotheses. Seeing no way to redeem his account from this problem, Nozick (1981: 198ff) was forced into the rather unorthodox position of having to deny the universal applicability of closure as a feature of knowledge.

Secondly, Nozick admits that the sensitivity condition cannot feature as a condition for knowledge of necessarily true propositions as there is no world in which such propositions are false since, by definition, necessarily true propositions are true in every possible world. The scope of the sensitivity condition is thus limited to knowledge of contingently true propositions. That the sensitivity condition cannot, for example, illuminate the nature of our mathematical or logical knowledge makes it less preferable, ceteris paribus, than a condition that can.

At the end of the twentieth century and the beginning of the twenty-first, several authors proposed a novel and relatively similar condition for knowledge that has come to be known as the safety condition, the elucidation of which being the objective here. As the relevant features of the safety condition are presented and explained, the following salient points will emerge. The safety condition is similar to the sensitivity condition in that it too is a modal condition for knowledge. That’s where any significant similarity ends. As shall be demonstrated at length, safety differs from sensitivity in the following ways. Firstly, and most importantly, safety permits knowing the denial of a radically skeptical hypothesis in a manner that maintains the closure principle. This advantage by itself acts as a strong point in favor of the safety condition. Secondly, most formulations of the safety condition are not in the form of a counterfactual. Thirdly, the safety condition is more expansive than the sensitivity condition in that its scope includes knowledge of both necessarily true and contingently true propositions. Lastly, epistemologists since then generally believe the safety condition opens the way to a more enlightened response to skepticism.

2. The Safety Condition as a Necessary Condition for Knowledge

The literature on the safety condition is challenging for even the seasoned philosopher. Seeing that Williamson, Pritchard, and Sosa have developed their thoughts over a lengthy period of time and in a large number of publications, it has become quite a task to keep track of the epicycles in the conceptual development and defense of the safety condition. Additionally, each of its advocates is motivated to formulate the safety condition in a distinct way, where even slight differences in formulation make for significant conceptual divergence. In light of these considerations, it is best to begin with a separate treatment of each author’s presentation of the safety condition before proceeding to an overall elucidation of the safety condition.

a. Timothy Williamson

Williamson (2000) is involved in the project of illuminating several structural features of knowledge. His safety condition is both the result of this project and an integral part of it.

Williamson, in stark opposition to the standard practice in the post-Gettier period, resists being drawn into offering a conceptual analysis of knowledge in terms of non-trivial and non-circular necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for knowledge, a project he thinks is futile given its history of repetitive failures. Knowledge, for Williamson, requires avoidance of error in similar cases. This is to be taken as a schema by which to elucidate the structural features of knowledge. The basic idea, then, is that S knows P only if S is safe from error; that is, there must be no risk or danger that S believes falsely in a similar case. The relevant modal notions of safety, risk, and danger are cashed out in terms of possible worlds such that there is no close world surrounding the actual world in which S falls into error: “safety is a sort of local necessity” (Williamson 2009d: 14). These possible worlds in which S truly believes P act as a kind of “buffer zone” from error and thereby prevent the type of epistemic luck that characterize Gettier cases. In Russell’s case, for example, S does not know that it’s noon since there is a close world in which S falsely believes that it’s noon, for instance, one in which S looks at the clock slightly before or after noon.

Despite Williamson’s opposition to the project of analyzing knowledge into non-trivial necessary and sufficient conditions, it seems clear enough that Williamson should be read as putting forward safety as a necessary condition for knowledge given that he presents the safety condition as a conditional using the appropriate locution only if. And this is how his critics typically interpret him. As Williamson formulates the safety condition in a number of different ways on different occasions, it is impossible to pin down one formulation as representing Williamson’s view. Here is one formulation that will suffice for the time being:

(SF)     If one knows, one could not easily have been wrong in a similar case (2000: 147)

Nevertheless, the manner in which Williamson expresses the safety condition still separates him from those who offer necessary conditions for knowledge. As Williamson emphasizes time and again, the safety condition, as he states it, is to be taken as a circular necessary condition in that whether or not a case β counts as a relevantly similar case to α is in part determined by whether we are inclined to attribute knowledge to the agent in α; safety (reliability in similar enough cases) cannot be defined without reference to knowledge, and knowledge without reference to safety (2000: 100; 2009d: 9-10). Safety, by Williamson’s lights is thus not to be taken as a recipe by which to determine whether or not the agent is to be attributed knowledge in each and every case. Rather, it is a model by which to illuminate the structural features of knowledge and by which we can begin talking about knowledge in individual cases. As Williamson observes, “the point of the safety conception of knowing is not to enable one to determine whether a knowledge attribution is true in a given case by applying one’s general understanding of safety, without reference to knowing itself. If one tried to do that, one would very likely get it wrong” (2009d: ibid.).

b. Duncan Pritchard

Pritchard is attracted to the idea that a conceptual analysis of our concept “luck” will yield sufficient insight from which to build a satisfactory anti-luck condition for knowledge. In other words, with a conceptual mastery of the nature of luck in hand, the problem of epistemic luck can, in theory, be overcome. Pritchard’s safety condition is thus formulated in a manner which reflects his work on the conceptual analysis of luck.

For Pritchard (2005: 128) an event E counts as lucky for an agent S if and only if E is significant to S and E obtains in the actual world but does not obtain in a wide class of nearby possible worlds in which the relevant initial conditions for that event are the same as in the actual world. For example, one is lucky not to be killed by a sniper’s bullet since in the actual world the bullet misses but it does not miss in the close worlds. Importantly, luck comes in degrees. One naturally counts as lucky if the sniper missed by a meter. But one counts as luckier if the sniper missed by a centimeter. The agent counts as luckier in the latter case, claims Pritchard (2009b: 39), because the world in which one is killed in that case is much closer to the actual world than the world in which one is killed in the former case (since the second sniper is better). Close worlds, then, can be roughly divided into two classes—near and non-near, and are to be weighted accordingly—the near close worlds count for more than the non-near close worlds.

The foregoing analysis of luck motivates the following analysis of epistemic luck: S is very lucky that her belief P is true in the actual world if P is false in at least one of the near close worlds. And S is lucky, but not as lucky, that her belief P is true if P is true in the actual world but false in at least one of the non-near close worlds. Stated otherwise, false belief in a very close world is incompatible with knowledge while false belief in a non-near close world is compatible with knowledge. Here is a formulation of the safety condition by Pritchard (2007, 2008, 2009a) as a non-circular necessary condition in a standard account of knowledge:

(SF*)     S’s belief is safe if and only if in most nearby possible worlds in which S continues to form her belief about the target proposition in the same way as in the actual world, and in all very close nearby possible worlds in which S continues to form her belief about the target proposition in the same way as in the actual world, the belief continues to be true.

That is to say, as long as S truly believes P using the same method in all of the very close worlds and in nearly all of the non-near close worlds, S’s belief P is safe. Accordingly, the agent in Russell’s case fails to know that it’s noon since there is a very close world in which she falsely believes that it’s noon, for example, the very close world in which that clock stops slightly before or after noon.

Pritchard’s focus is knowledge of contingently true propositions. However, Pritchard (2009a: 34) claims that to extend the safety condition to handle knowledge of a necessarily true proposition P, which is true in all possible worlds, his safety condition can easily be augmented in such a way as to require that S not falsely believe a different proposition Q in a very close world and nearly all non-near close worlds using the same method that S used in the actual world.

Of the many ways in which Pritchard’s condition differs from Williamson’s, it is evident that they differ in one very important respect: Pritchard’s condition permits relatively few cases of falsely believing P in non-near close worlds. Pritchard is motivated to make this concession since his safety condition is informed by his account of luck, which counts S lucky vis-à-vis an event E even though E occurs in some non-near close worlds. Williamson’s condition, by contrast, has a zero tolerance policy for false belief in any close world.

c. Ernest Sosa

Sosa arrives at his formulation of the safety condition as a necessary condition for knowledge by way of working through some of the fundamental shortcomings he identifies in Goldman’s relevant alternatives condition and Nozick’s sensitivity condition. As Sosa puts it, both Goldman and Nozick failed to adequately capture the way in which the proposition believed must be modally related to the truth of that proposition. For Sosa, an agent S counts as knowing P only if S believes P by way of a safe method or, in Sosa’s words, a safe “indication” or “deliverance.”

Sosa’s formulation of the safety condition differs from both Williamson’s and Pritchard’s in that it is stipulated in the form of the following counterfactual (1999a: 146):

(SF**)       If S were to believe P, P would be true [B(P) ☐→ P]

The following short note on counterfactuals helps explain the logic of (SF**). Firstly, according to Lewis’s semantics for counterfactuals (1973), a counterfactual of the form P ☐→ Q is true at a world W only if some world in which P and Q are true is closer to W than any world in which P is true but Q false. Since Lewis thinks that the closest world to W is W itself, the counterfactual PQ is trivially true at W if P and Q are both true at W. Accordingly, when the antecedent of a counterfactual is true, it follows that P & Q entails P ☐→ Q. Nozick (1981: 176, 680 n.8) finds this result untenable and rejects Lewisian semantics for counterfactuals with true antecedents. Sosa concurs with Nozick. On their semantics for counterfactuals with true antecedents, the counterfactual B(P) ☐→ P is true at a world W if and only if S truly believes P by method M in W and in all close worlds in which S believes P by method M, P is true. It follows, then, that like (SF) and unlike (SF*), Sosa’s condition entails zero tolerance for false belief in any close world.

Secondly, though remarkably similar to the sensitivity condition, (SF**) is not logically equivalent to the sensitivity condition [¬P ☐→ ¬B(P)] since contraposition is invalid for counterfactuals. The following example, from Lewis (1973: 35) demonstrates that contraposition (A→B) ↔ (¬B → ¬ A) is invalid for counterfactuals. Consider the following counterfactual: (A) If Boris had gone to the party, then Olga would still have gone. It should be clear that (A) is not equivalent to its contraposition (B) If Olga had not gone to the party then Boris would still not have gone, because althoughwhile (A) is true (B) is false since Boris would have gone had Olga been absent from the party.

In light of these considerations about counterfactuals, Sosa’s formulation of safety explains why the agent in Russell’s case lacks knowledge. Since there is a close world in which he uses the same method as he does in the actual world at a slightly earlier or later time, namely consulting a broken clock, and thereby comes to falsely believe it to be noon, his belief in the actual world is not safe.

Sosa has since moved on from defending a “brute” safety condition as a necessary condition for knowledge. Sosa (2007, 2009) argues that an agent’s belief must be apt and adroit to count as knowledge, where such virtues differ from safety considerations.

3. Elucidating the Safety Condition

The presentation of the safety condition thus far has been intentionally bare-boned for introductory purposes. This section is devoted to spelling out the finer details or characteristics of the condition, which is a rather challenging task given the presence of some vague patches in the safety literature.

It goes without saying that for epistemic purposes possible worlds W1, …, WN count as relevantly closer to or further from the world W in which S believes P at time T on a case by case basis relative to most or all of the following factors: the belief P, time T, the agent S, and the method M by which S formed the belief P at T in W. In other words, the conditions of belief formation, represented by the set {S, P, T, M}, play a constitutive, though not exclusive, role in a determination of closeness. (With respect to safety, one can either think of these possible worlds as branching possibilities à la Hawthorne and Lasonen-Aarnio (2009) or as concentric circles surrounding a subject-centered world, as Lewis (1973: 149) does in his semantics for counterfactuals.) It follows, then, that the adequacy of the safety condition will turn on, among other things, how close worlds are to be specified, the time of the belief formation, what type of reliability is at play, and how safety theorists understand methods. A foray into these important questions follows.

a. What Counts as a Close World?

Before attempting to answer this important question, four points must be made. Firstly, to satisfy the safety condition it is not the case that in every close world the agent must truly believe the relevant proposition; that is to say, S can safely believe P in W even though there are close worlds in which the agent does not form the belief P, for example, where S does not believe the target proposition in several of the close worlds because S is distracted or preoccupied. For instance, in world W S comes to believe that a car is approaching when S sees a car coming down the road. There may very well be a close world in which S is standing in exactly that same position at that very time but does not form the belief that a car is approaching because S turns her head in the opposite direction to look at a squirrel in a tree. The lack of belief about the approaching car in these close worlds does not prevent S from safely believing in W that a car is approaching. In light of such considerations, it is useful to consider close worlds as divided into two broad categories—relevant and irrelevant—a distinction which will prove important in the discussion on skepticism. below.

Secondly, as Williamson points out (2000: 100), the safety condition is notoriously vague owing to knowledge and reliability being vague concepts. As such it is unlikely that we will arrive at a very determinate answer as to exactly which worlds count as close; our expectations must be lowered. The problems this vagueness generates will become evident in section 4.

Thirdly, as Hawthorne (2004: 56) notes, closeness, as it pertains to safety, cannot be cashed out in terms of the notion of similarity found in counterfactuals. A counterfactual of the form P ☐→ Q is non-vacuously true at a world W only if some world in which P and Q are true is closer to W than any world in which P is true but Q false. When determining the truth conditions for counterfactuals, the history of both the actual world and the close world in which the antecedent is true are held fixed. When it comes to safety, possible worlds with a different history to W can nevertheless count as close, as will become evident below. Additionally, unlike the similarity of two worlds for epistemic purposes, the similarity of worlds for the purposes of counterfactuals need not be agent-relative.

Lastly, it is unclear whether believing a truthvalueless proposition (for example, one that fails to refer) in a close world should count as a knowledge-denying error possibility. Hawthorne (2004: 56) thinks it should since these count as “failed attempts at a true belief.” None of the safety theorists discuss this type of case.

Now on to the four main determinants of closeness:

i. The Time Factor

As far as safety goes, two worlds W and W* may count as similar at a time T with respect to the set {S, P, M} yet count as distant from each another, with respect to that same set, at a time prior to or following T. Consequently, if S falsely believes P in W* at T, then S’s belief P in W at T is unsafe. The following two cases illustrate that for the purposes of safe belief closeness must be understood as indexed to a point in time.

Cases concerning knowledge of the future demonstrate that similarity between two worlds at the time of belief formation trumps dissimilarity at a later time. Suppose, for the sake of illustration, that in a world W at time T (sometime in May 2009) an agent S truly believes that London will host the 2012 Olympics as a result of reading so in a local newspaper. In many possible worlds S similarly believes as much from reading the paper.  Yet in some of these worlds things in 2012 may be radically different from the way things will be in W in 2012 when the Olympics indeed take place in London. For example, in one of these worlds W* the British economy collapses and no Olympics take place in London in 2012. In W* S’s belief at T is thus false. Nonetheless, W and W* may count as close at T despite these significant differences between these two worlds in 2012 given how similar these two worlds are with respect to the set {S, M, P, T} i.e. the details of S’s belief episode at T in which she comes to believe that London will host the 2012 Olympics as a result of reading so in the newspaper.

It is not the case, however, that for a world W* to be close to world W at T it must share a complete history with W up to and including time T. The following case elucidates this point. It is taken for granted that if in W Sally walks into a showroom displaying red shoes under red overhead lights she does not know that there are red shoes on display if there is a close world W* in which there are white shoes on display but which look red under red lights. Notice that W* counts as close to W at T even though they do not share an identical history: at T-N, where N is some duration, the factory owner in W* is placing white shoes on the display shelves and turning red lights on.

Additionally, insisting on shared histories would make safety trivially true in some cases where the target proposition believed is true and concerns the present or the past; namely, were close worlds only those worlds which share complete histories with the actual world until the moment at which the belief is formed, then it would follow that in some cases the proposition believed would be trivially safe, which is an unacceptable consequence. Accordingly, if I recall going to the gym yesterday then I know I went to the gym yesterday only if there is no close world which differs from the actual world with respect to my going to the gym yesterday and in which I falsely believe I went to the gym yesterday.

There is room to think that the conceptual content of “could easily have falsely believed” permits playing around with the time of the belief formation itself. It stands to reason, then, cases of belief formation in a possible world W* which occur shortly before or after the belief formation in W should be factored into knowledge determinations as well. If S forms a false belief in those cases then S’s belief in W is unsafe. The motivation for permitting this flexibility with the time factor is that it allows safety to handle a wide variety of cases in which time is part of the content of the proposition believed, as exemplified by the Russell case. For example, S looks at two people kissing at a new year’s party and forms the true belief that it’s the new year. S does not count as knowing that it’s the new year if there is a close world in which just prior to midnight these two people begin kissing slightly before midnight, as a result of which S falsely believes it’s the new year.

ii. What Type of Reliability does Safety Require?

Reliability, as a property of a belief-forming method, comes in different kinds, two of which are important for the purpose at hand—local and global. The latter refers to a method M’s reliability in producing a range of token output beliefs in different propositions P, Q, R, …, and so forth. A method M is globally reliable if and only if it produces sufficiently more true beliefs than false beliefs in a range of different propositions. For example, M could be the visual process and P the proposition that there is a pencil on the desk, Q the proposition that there are clouds in the sky, and R the proposition that the bin is black. If a sufficiently high number of P, Q, R, … are true then method M is globally reliable. A method M is locally reliable with respect to an individual target belief P if and only if M produces a sufficient ratio of more true beliefs than false beliefs in that very proposition P.

Accounts of knowledge in the post-Gettier period differ with regards to which type of reliability is necessary for knowledge. Nozick and Dretske think only local reliability is needed, McGinn (1999) requires global reliability to the exclusion of local reliability, and Goldman (1986: 47) requires both. Where do Williamson, Pritchard, and Sosa fall on this spectrum? With respect to (SF**), it is evident from the manner in which Sosa formulates his safety condition that he thinks that only local reliability is necessary for knowledge in so far as (SF**) concerns truly believing a specific proposition P; that is, no mention is made of not falsely believing a different proposition Q. Notice, however, that as far as safety goes, Sosa requires that the agent exhibit perfect local reliability; that is, there can be no close world in which S falsely believes P.

Unlike Sosa, Pritchard, in order to handle knowledge of necessarily true propositions, requires global reliability, but a nuanced version thereof. Recall that Pritchard permits some false beliefs in non-near close worlds but has a zero tolerance for false beliefs in the nearer close worlds. Therefore, Pritchard can be classified as requiring perfect global reliability in the near close worlds and regular global reliability in the non-near close worlds. Additionally, both Pritchard and Sosa permit falsely believing P in a close world via a different method than the one used in the actual world.

With regards to Williamson, it is much harder to pin down the type of reliability at work in (SF). As mentioned, Williamson formulates the safety condition in different ways in different places. Some of these formulations clearly advocate for local reliability only, while others incorporate global reliability. And, further still, others push for subtler versions of both. Starting with local reliability, consider this formulation:

(SF1)     “[I]n a case α one is safe from error in believing that [a condition] C obtains if and only if there is no case close to α in which one falsely believes that C obtains” (2000: 126-7).

A condition, for Williamson (ibid.: 52), is specified by a “that” clause relative to an agent and a time. Thus, “S believes that the tree is i inches tall” counts as S believing that a certain condition obtains. According to Williamson (ibid.: 114ff), a typical agent who looks at a tree and believes “that the tree is i inches tall” does not know “that the tree is i inches tall” because there is a close world in which the agent uses that same method and comes to falsely believe “that the tree is i inches tall” when in fact it is i+1 inches tall. Most people are unreliable about the height of trees to the nearest inch because our eyesight is not that powerful; we cannot tell the height of a tree to the nearest inch just by looking at it. This case demonstrates that Williamson requires local reliability since this is a case in which the agent lacks knowledge because there is a close world in which he falsely believes the same proposition using the same method as that used in the actual world. Given that for Williamson safe belief entails a zero tolerance for false belief in a close world, Williamson requires perfect local reliability.

Here is another formulation of the safety condition by Williamson (2000: 124):

(SF2)     “One avoids false belief reliably in α if and only if one avoids false belief in every  case similar enough to α.”

This formulation seems to rule out knowledge in the following case. Pat is pulling cards out of a hat on which sentences are written. Pat pulls the first out and upon reading it truly believes that oranges are fruits. Pat then pulls a second card out and upon reading the sentence written on it falsely believes that America is a province of Australia. Pat’s true belief that oranges are fruits is unsafe because Pat does not avoid false belief in a similar case; that is, Pat could easily have falsely believed a different proposition using the same method in a close world. Because Pat uses a globally unreliable method she lacks knowledge. Given that for Williamson, safe belief entails a zero tolerance for false belief in a close world, Williamson therefore also requires perfect global reliability.

Yet further formulations of safety by Williamson advocate for subtler versions of local and global reliability. Recall that as Pritchard and Sosa present the safety condition, knowing P is compatible with falsely believing P via a different method in a close world. Williamson agrees, but with a caveat:

(SF3)    “P is required to be true only in similar cases in which it is believed on a similar basis” (2009: 364-5).

So for S to safely believe P via M not only must S not falsely believe P in any close world via M, S must also not falsely believe P using a relevantly similar method to M. Williamson extends this principle in a way that results in a non-standard version of global reliability:

(SF4)   If in a case α one knows P on a basis B, then in any case close to α in which one believes a proposition P* close to P on a basis [B*] close to B, then P* is true (2009: 325).

In other words, to safely believe P via M in α it must also be the case that one does not falsely believe P* via M* in a close case. For ease of reference, here is a gloss in the vicinity of Williamson’s conception of a safe belief:

(SF!)  S safely believes P via a method M in world W if and only if there is no close world to W in which:

(i)    S falsely believes P via M or a relevantly similar method M*; or

(ii)   S falsely believes any proposition via M; or

(iii)  S falsely believes a relevantly similar proposition P* using a relevantly similar method M*.

Williamson is thus committed to S knowing P in W at T only if S (SF!)-safely believes P. Since Williamson’s picture of “could easily have falsely believed” is richer than Pritchard’s or Sosa’s, more is needed to be safe from error for Williamson than for the latter two.

There are reasons independent of any of these three authors that suggest that knowledge should require both global and a local reliability. Firstly, the problem of vagueness supports a global reliability formulation of safety as follows. Some vague concepts may have different meanings in different worlds. It follows, then, that sentences with the same words can express different propositions in different worlds even when these worlds are very close (Williamson 1994: 230-4). For example, the property expressed by bald in the actual world might be having less than twenty hairs on one’s head while the property expressed by bald in a close world W might be having less than eighteen hairs on one’s head. If this is the case, then the sentence Pollock is bald expresses different propositions in these two worlds. Hence if Jackson, in the actual world, believes of Pollock that he is bald (Pollock having nineteen hairs on his head) then his belief will turn out to be unsafe as there is a close world, namely W, in which Jackson falsely believes of Pollock that he is bald. In cases such as these, for an agent to know P via M it must be the case that the agent could not easily have falsely believed P* via M (where P* counts as a different proposition in that close world).

Knowledge of propositions with singular content requires safety to be formulated in a globally reliable way. Consider the case in which Jones, looking at a real barn surrounded by fake barns, forms the true belief that “that is a barn.” The intuition is to deny Jones knowledge despite the fact that there is no close world in which that very barn is not a barn (assuming that a barn is essentially a barn). Since Jones could easily have falsely believed of a fake barn that “that is a barn,” which expresses a different and false proposition, Jones is denied knowledge.

iii. Methods

Methods can be individuated in a variety of ways: internally or externally, and in a coarse-grained or fine-grained way.

A way of individuating methods is internal if it respects the constraint that agents who form a belief P and who are internal duplicates share the same method; and external if it does not respect that constraint. Alternatively, if method individuation supervenes solely on brain states, then methods are internally individuated; if two agents can be in the same brain state yet be using different methods, then methods are individuated externally.

A way of individuating methods is coarse-grained if methods are described broadly or generally for example, the visual method. On the other hand, a way of individuating methods is fine-grained if methods are described in detail for example, the visual method for large objects at close range under favorable lighting conditions. As the degree of detail to which a method can be described is a parameter along a continuous spectrum, fine-grained and coarse-grained individuation permit of a wide range of generality or detail. Specifying the relevant detail for each method is known as the generality problem for reliabilism. Given that reliably believing is part of safety, safety faces the generality problem, something Williamson acknowledges (2009: 308).

Nozick (1981: 233) argues for an accessibility constraint on method individuation; that is, regardless of how methods are individuated, a difference in methods must always be accessible to the agent. It is evident, then, that an accessibility constraint is in tension with both external and fine-grained individuation since, ex hypothesi, neither the difference between seeing and hallucinating nor the difference between two finely-grained methods would be detectable by the typical agent.

Williamson and Pritchard deny such an accessibility constraint, thereby opening the way for external, fine-grained individuation of methods. For Williamson the accessibility constraint assumes that methods are a luminous condition, where a luminous condition is defined as a condition such that whenever it obtains the agent is in a position to know that it obtains (Williamson 2000: 95). But, as Williamson (ibid.: 96-8) argues, no non-trivial condition is luminous. Therefore the accessibility condition should be disregarded.

Pritchard (2005: 153) argues that safety will get the wrong result in some cases unless the accessibility condition is dropped because agents are fallible when it comes to determining which methods they use. For example, S might incorrectly think that she believes P via method M when in fact she believes it via M*. In some cases M delivers safe belief while M* doesn’t. Were the relevant method for a determination of safety the method the agent considers to be the one by which she believes, safety would get the wrong result in such cases.

One further argument against the accessibility condition is that it generates an infinite regress: S must be aware of which method she uses to believe P, the method she used to determine that, the method she used to determine that, and so on. Although these three arguments do not entail that internal and coarse-grained individuation are unsustainable, they do show that one reason in favor of such positions is unpromising.

We typically talk about methods or bases of belief in a coarse-grained way.  Williamson, however, adopts a fine-grained, external individuation of bases. For example, Williamson (2009b: 307, 325 n.13) thinks that, other things being equal, seeing a daschund and seeing a wolf count as different bases; believing that one is drinking pure, unadulterated water on the basis of drinking pure, unadulterated water from a glass is not the same basis as believing as much when drinking water from a glass that has been doctored with undetectable toxins by conniving agents; believing that one was shown x number of flashes after drinking regular orange juice does not count as the same basis as believing that one was shown x number of flashes after drinking a glass of orange juice with a tasteless mind-altering drug; and, finally, believing that S1 is married by looking at S1’s wedding ring and believing that S2 is married by looking at S2’s wedding ring count as different methods if S1 reliably wears her ring and S2 does not.

Williamson is inclined towards external, (super) fine-grained individuation of methods owing to his position vis-à-vis luminosity and skepticism. Regarding the former, in some cases the circumstances of a case can change in very gradual ways that the agent fails to detect such that at the start of the case the basis of belief is reliable while unreliable at the end of the case. Consider, for example, a case in which I see a pencil on a desk in front of me under favorable conditions. Assumedly I know that there is a pencil on the desk. I then begin to gradually walk backwards from the desk all the while keeping my eyes on the pencil until I reach a point at which it appears as a mere blur in the distance. At that point beliefs I form based on vision are no more than guesses. At each point in my growing distance from the desk my visual abilities start deteriorating slowly such that at some indiscernible point my eyesight no longer counts as reliable with respect to the pencil. Were bases of belief individuated in an internal, coarse-grained manner such that my looking at the pencil close-up and my looking at the pencil at a distance count as the same method, then I would fail to know that there is a pencil on the desk when close to the table since there is a close world in which I look at it from a distance and form a false belief that there is pen on the desk, which is intuitively the incorrect result. Consequently, minimal changes in the external environment result in a difference in the basis of belief formation.

iv. Skepticism

One of the selling points of safety is that it, unlike the relevant alternatives and sensitivity conditions, permits one to know the denial of skeptical hypotheses, thereby maintaining closure. Here is the skeptical argument from closure:

(1)   I know I have hands.

(2)   If I know I have hands then I know I am not a brain in the vat.

(3)   I don’t know that I am not a brain in the vat.

This triad is inconsistent because, claims the skeptic, one cannot know the denials of skeptical hypotheses; that is, one cannot know that one is not in the bad case (the denial of (3)). In other words, if I know I have hands, then by closure I should know I am not a handless brain in the vat. But, claims the skeptic, one is never in a position to know that one is not a handless brain in the vat. It follows, then, that I do not know that I have hands.

Pritchard (2005: 159) claims that if one is in the good case then one sees that one has hands based on perception. In the bad case one does not see that one has hands; rather, one is fed images of hands. As a result of this difference in method, the bad case automatically counts as irrelevant since only those cases in which one forms beliefs based on veridical perception count as relevant: “only those nearby possible worlds in which the agent formed her belief in the same way as in the actual world are at issue” (ibid. 161). Since, by definition of the cases, the brain in the vat is not using the same method as the agent in the good case, one can consequently know the denial of the skeptical hypothesis entailed by one’s knowledge of everyday propositions since there is no close world to the good case in which one falsely believes the denial of the skeptical hypothesis.

Williamson resists skepticism by exposing and undermining those claims that tempt us towards (3); namely the idea that a brain in the vat and the agent in the good case have exactly the same evidence. According to Williamson (2000: 9) “one’s total evidence is simply one’s total knowledge.” Since the agent in the good case has good evidence and the brain the vat has bad evidence, this constitutes a sufficient dissimilarity between the cases. Therefore, the false belief in the bad case counts as irrelevant to true belief in the good case. Alternatively, Williamson can be read as saying that individuating methods externally and in a fine-grained manner leads to the conclusion that believing truly on the basis of good evidence is sufficiently dissimilar to believing falsely on the basis of bad evidence (ibid.: 169). The epistemic impoverishment of the brain in the vat is thus irrelevant. Williamson (2009d: 21) has made the following further claim:

The idea is that when one knows p “on basis b,” worlds in which one does not believe p “on basis b” do not count as close; but knowing “on basis b” requires p to be true in all close worlds in which one believes p “on basis b;” thus p is true in all close worlds. In this sense, the danger from which one is safe is p’s being false, not only one’s believing p when it is false.

Thus the bad case counts as far off because in the bad case P is false. This difference between the good and bad cases constitutes a sufficient dissimilarity to permit one to know in the good case.

Since Sosa is not as explicit about how he builds methods into his safety condition, all three strategies are compatible with what he says. For example, he sometimes talks as if the bad case is far off (1999a: 147; 2000: 15), while at other times (1999b: 379) he can be read as thinking that even if it were close it would be irrelevant because the agent is using a different method in that case.

There are thus three different strategies a safety theorist can employ to oppose skepticism:

(i)  Since the agent in the bad case uses a different method from the agent in the good case, the bad case is sufficiently dissimilar from the good case and thus does not count as close;

(ii) The bad case counts as close to the good case yet is irrelevant given that the agent in the bad case uses a different method from the agent in the good case;

(iii) While the agents in the good and bad cases use the same method, the bad case counts as far off given the overall dissimilarities between it and the good case;

The safety condition is therefore a powerful tool against skepticism. For skepticism to be an appealing theory the skeptic would have to provide some reason for thinking that in  every case α involving an agent S, method M, time T, and proposition P, there is a close  and relevant case β in which a skeptical hypothesis is true such that S could easily have failed to be locally or globally reliable in α with respect to P at T (where the definitions of local and global reliability differ depending on which safety theorist is in question).

b. How do the Safety and Sensitivity Conditions Differ?

Given that the sensitivity condition for knowledge enjoyed such prominence, it is important to determine how the safety condition differs from it. Such a comparison will shed light on some virtues of the safety condition relative to the sensitivity condition.

In some cases sensitivity is the more stringent condition, while in others safety is. The following two points of logic elicit the difference between the safety and sensitivity conditions. When it comes to cases concerning knowledge of the denial of skeptical hypotheses, the safety principle is less demanding than the sensitivity principle. The latter principle requires that the agent not believe P in the nearest possible world in which P is false. As such no agent can know the denial of skeptical hypotheses by the simple sensitivity test, for example, I am not a brain in the vat, because in the nearest possible world in which the agent is a brain in the vat the agent continues to believe (falsely) that he is not a brain in the vat. So while agents typically satisfy the sensitivity condition with respect to everyday propositions and thus count as knowing many everyday propositions, they cannot satisfy the sensitivity condition with respect to the denial of skeptical hypothesis. Hence the incompatibility of the sensitivity condition and single-premise closure, for knowledge of everyday propositions entails knowledge of the denial of skeptical hypotheses incompatible with those propositions.

The safety principle, however, is compatible with single-premise closure for it permits knowing the denial of skeptical hypotheses. By the safety principle I count as knowing the everyday proposition P “that I have hands” by method M only if I safely believe P. It follows, then, that if I safely believe P then there is no close world in which I am a brain in the vat and am led to falsely believe that I have hands by M (as explained in the previous section). Consequently, if I know that I have hands and I know that that entails that I am not a brain in the vat, then I know that I am not a brain in the vat.

On the other hand, cases can be constructed in which safety is more demanding than sensitivity. Consider the following case: S truly believes P via M in the actual world but (i) in the closest world in which P is false S does not believe P, and (ii) there is a close world in which S falsely believes P via M. In this case S satisfies the sensitivity condition but fails to satisfy the safety condition. A case by Goldman (1986: 45) can be used to illustrate this point. Mary has an unreliable thermometer in her medicine cabinet which she uses to measure her temperature. It just so happens to correctly read her temperature of 38°C in this case. However, in the nearest world in which her temperature is not 38°C and she uses this thermometer to take her temperature, she is distracted by her son and she doesn’t form any belief about her temperature. She accordingly satisfies the sensitivity condition for knowledge since she does not believe P in the nearest world in which P is false. However, there is some other close world in which she uses this thermometer to take her temperature and forms a false belief thereby. Mary thus fails to satisfy the safety condition. It follows, then, that the following pair of conditionals are false:

If S safely believes P then S sensitively believes P.

If S sensitively believes P then S safely believes P.

The logic of these conditionals makes explicit the respects in which safety is similar to and different from the sensitivity condition.

c. The Semantics of Safety

In a non-epistemic context it is easy to see that “safe” can function as a gradable adjective. For instance, if S has three paths to choose from to get to her destination, it is perfectly acceptable to say that although path X is safe, Y is safer, and that path Z the safest of the three paths. “Similarity” also comes in degrees: London is more similar to Manchester than to Kabul. Possible worlds can thus be closer to or further from the actual world on a sliding scale of similarity. S’s belief P, therefore, can be safer than S’s belief Q. Although “safe” is a gradable adjective, the safety condition is not presented within the framework of a contextualist semantics for “knowledge,” where, roughly speaking, contextualism about ”knowledge” is the claim that the truth conditions of the proposition “S knows P” depend on the context of the attributer. In other words, “knowledge” picks out different relations in the different contexts of attribution where said contexts are a function of the varying interests of the attributer, not the possessor, of knowledge. Contextualism has gained its popularity through, among other things, its proposed solution to the skeptical challenge from closure. Sosa, Williamson, and Pritchard are all standard invariantists about the semantics of knowledge, invariantism being the denial of contextualism. (See Williamson (2009d: 18) for two different ways in which the gradability of safety can be accommodated without adopting a contextualist semantics for “know.”) If one’s main concern is skepticism, then the safety theorist has no need for a contextualist semantics for “knowledge” given the three strategies available to them for opposing skepticism (listed above). Nonetheless, it is easy enough to see how one could model the safety condition along contextualist lines if one had independent reasons for adopting a contextualist semantics for “knowledge”—those factors that weigh in on the similarity measure of close worlds will be those salient to the attributer, not the agent.

4. Safety in Action

To get a better feel for how the safety condition works, it proves beneficial to undertake an exercise in seeing how safety handles some of the troubling cases in the literature. Obviously each case can be modified in such a way as to make things harder or easier for the safety theorist. For present purposes such cases will be ignored.

a. Gettier and Chisholm

Jones is told by his boss that Smith will get the promotion. Jones then sees Smith putting ten  coins in his pocket. Jones accordingly infers that the man who will get the promotion has ten coins in his pocket. However, Jones (not Smith) gets the job and Jones just so happens to have ten coins in his pocket. According to Gettier (1963) Jones’s belief does not amount to knowledge. How does the safety condition handle this case? Jones’s belief is unsafe because there are close worlds in which (a) in which Carter gets the job but has no coins in his pocket, or (b) in which Jones get the job but has nine coins in his pocket.

The same reasoning applies to Chisholm’s (1977) case in which Jones believes that there is a sheep in the field upon seeing a fluffy white animal in the distance. However, while what Jones sees is a white dog there is indeed a sheep in the field lying behind a rock hidden from Jones’s sight. According to Chisholm, Jones doesn’t count as knowing that there is a sheep in the field. The safety condition captures this intuition. Jones’s belief is unsafe because there is a close world in which there is no sheep behind the rock and Jones falsely believes that there is a sheep in the field; that is, the method of inferring the presence of sheep by seeing dogs is unreliable.

b. Fake Barns

Jones is in an area with many fake barns. Jones sees a real barn in the field and forms the belief that there is a barn in the field. Does Jones know that there is a barn in the field? Prima facie, Jones’s belief counts as unsafe as there is a close world in which he looks at a fake barn and falsely believes that it is a (real) barn.

However, this case turns out to be a little harder to explain because the details of the case can be manipulated into yielding bizarre intuitions in similarly structured cases (Hawthorne and Gendler 2005). What if, for example, Jones would not have come across such a fake barn because he wasn’t in walking distance of it? The permutations of the standard setup of this case abound (see for example, Peacocke (1999: 324), Neta and Rohrbaugh (2004: 399), Comesaña (2005: 396), and Lackey (2006)). Similar permutations can be made for the Gettier and Chisholm cases, for example, where circumstances are such that the person who gets the job in all close worlds has ten coins in his or her pocket or that in all close worlds there is a sheep behind the rock.

This is one of those cases that manifests the vagueness present in the safety condition. As Williamson (2000: 100; 2009b: 305) indicates, there will be cases in which whether or not one thinks that there is a close world in which the agent falsely believes depends on whether or not one is inclined to attribute knowledge to that agent in that case; the vagueness in “relevantly similar,” “reliable,” and “knowledge” knowledge determinations in some cases notoriously difficult. Accordingly, the direction of one’s intuitions about whether or not Jones knows in each permutation of these cases will influence whether or not one thinks Jones has a false belief in a close world, and vice versa.

There is one significant permutation of this case that requires attention. Suppose the details of the case remain identical except that instead of forming the belief P that there is a barn in the field, Jones forms the belief Q that that is a barn (Hawthorne 2004: 56). Recall that Q is a singular proposition but P is not, where, roughly, a singular proposition is one that is constitutively about some particular. Sosa would have to find other reasons to deny Jones knowledge in this case, if he thinks he lacks it, given that his safety condition requires local reliability and true singular propositions are true in all close worlds. According to Williamson and Pritchard, Jones lacks knowledge in this case because there is a close world in which Jones looks at a fake barn and his belief that that is a barn expresses a different and false proposition.

c. Matches

Jones is about to light a match and forms the belief that the match will light once struck since all dry matches of this brand that he has struck have lit after being struck. However, the match doesn’t light because it was struck but rather does so because of some rare burst of radiation (adapted from Skyrms 1967: 383). Stipulate further that in all close worlds the match lights by friction. Is Jones’s belief safe?

The safety theorist seems drawn into denying knowledge in this case because there is a sense in which Jones is still lucky, in an epistemically malignant way, that his belief is true. When described in this way, this case is a stronger version of many of the Gettier cases mentioned so far because Jones’s belief is true by luck in the actual world but not so in any close world. Such cases would demonstrate that safety is not necessary for knowledge.

One way around this difficulty would be via Williamson’s claim that worlds which differ as far as trends go count as far off (see below B(i)). Hence, only worlds in which the match lights by a freak burst of radiation count as close. If worlds are ordered in this way, the example is presented in a flawed way that incorrectly indicates a problem for safety. Since the match lights in all those close worlds via radiation, Jones knows that his match will light.

5. Problems for Safety

As epistemologists ponder the details of the safety condition, it is to be expected that some will identify what they perceive to be its weaknesses or its failures. This section is devoted to three problem areas for safety.

a. Knowledge of Necessarily True Propositions

A necessarily true proposition is one which is true in all possible worlds. One might think, therefore, that knowledge of such propositions presents a problem for safety since there can be no close world in which S falsely believes such propositions. It should be clear at this point that this is a problem primarily for Sosa since his condition requires local reliability only; that is, not falsely believing P in close worlds. In other words, the counterfactual B(P) ☐→ P will be trivially true for any proposition P which is necessarily true. So knowledge of necessarily true propositions is going to be a problem for any account of knowledge that requires local reliability only.

Williamson and Pritchard have no such problems with knowledge of necessary truths since both require global reliability. There are cases that demonstrate that the method used to believe a necessarily true proposition can be globally unreliable. For example, suppose I use a coin to decide whether to believe 42 x 17 = 714 or to believe 32 ÷ 0.67 = 40, where I have no idea which is true without the use of a calculator. If the coin lands in such a way indicating that I should believe the first, which is necessarily true, then I am lucky to believe the necessary truth and not the necessary falsehood. I consequently do not know that 42 x 17 = 714 as I could just have easily have falsely believed the different proposition expressed by  32 ÷ 0.67 = 40.

b. Knowledge of the Future

The following lottery puzzle is particularly troublesome for safety. On the assumption that a proposition about a future state of affairs is either true or false, we take ourselves to know many things about the future, for example, that the Lakers game is next Tuesday, or that the elections will be held next month. This being the case, intuitively at least, Suzy knows that she won’t be able to afford to buy a new house this year. On the other hand, we deny that Suzy knows that her lottery ticket will lose (even if the draw has already taken place and Suzy has not yet learnt of the draw result). This state of affairs, however, presents the following puzzle: assuming single-premise closure true, if Suzy knows that she won’t be able to afford to buy a new house this year, and knows that this entails that her ticket is a loser, then Suzy should be in a position to know that her ticket will lose (by deduction). But it is commonly held that agents do not know that their lottery tickets will lose. (The aptness of this intuition is often demonstrated by the impropriety of flatly asserting that one knows that one’s ticket will lose, or selling one’s ticket for a penny before learning of the draw results.) The intuitive pull of single-premise closure is in tension with intuitions about what can be known about the future and about lottery tickets.

Problems involving lotteries generalize (Hawthorne 2004: 3). For instance, we are willing to say that Peter knows that (P) he will be living in Sydney this coming year. Yet we are hesitant to say that Peter knows that (Q) he won’t be one of those unfortunate few to be involved in a fatal car accident in the coming months. Assuming single premise closure true, if we are willing to attribute to Peter knowledge of P, and Peter knows that P entails Q, we should then be willing to attribute Peter knowledge of Q.

One way of explaining why agents do not know that their lottery tickets will lose or that they won’t die in unexpected accidents is that both events have a non-zero objective probability of occurring. That is, events with a non-zero probability of occurring can occur in close worlds. Naturally, then, one might think that the world in which one’s lottery ticket wins or in which one dies from an unexpected motor accident is close and that therefore one’s beliefs that one will lose the lottery or not die in an accident are unsafe.

This line of thinking is devastating for safety, however, as it would effectively rule out knowledge of any propositions the content of which regards the future since, assuming indeterminism true, there is a non-zero probability that any proposition about the future will be false; that is, for any true proposition P about the future there will be a close world in which P is false and one believes P. If safety leads directly to skepticism about knowledge of the future this would be a good reason to give up safety.

One line of thought for a safety theorist to pursue in response to this problem is to support the following high-chance-close-world principle (HCCW): if there is a high objective chance at T1 that the proposition P believed by S at T1 will be false at T2 given the state of the world at T1 and the laws of nature, then S does not know P at T1 as P is unsafe (even if P is true). The thinking behind this response is that if there is a high chance of some event occurring then that event could easily have occurred, which indicates that there is a natural connection between high chance and danger. For instance, if there is a high objective chance that the tornado will move in the direction of Kentucky, then it seems natural to say that Kentucky’s inhabitants are in danger.

Hawthorne and Lasonen-Aarnio (2009) demonstrate that HCCW presents some rather unwelcomed problems for the safety theorist. Firstly, HCCW is in tension with knowledge by multi-premise closure. Suppose, by way of example, that at T1 a subject S knows a range of chancy propositions P, Q, R, … about the future; that is, there is no close world in which any of those propositions are false. That said, while there may be a low probability for each proposition in that set that it will be false, for a sufficiently high number of propositions the probability at T1 that the conjunction of {P, Q, R, …} will be true at T2 will be very low . Accordingly, the probability of the negation of {P, Q, R, …} is very high at T1. By the lights of HCCW there will then be a close world in which that conjunction is false. Therefore, while an agent may know each conjunct in a set of chancy propositions about the future, the safety theorist who is committed to HCCW must deny that the agent knows the conjunction of those propositions. HCCW is therefore incompatible with multi-premise closure.

HCCW also creates problems for single-premise closure. Consider Plumpton who is about to begin a significantly long series of deductions from a true premise P1 towards a true conclusion PN. Suppose that at every step there is a significantly low objective probability that Plumpton’s deductive faculty will misfire leading him towards a false belief. If the chain is sufficiently long then there will be a high enough probability that the belief at the end of Plumpton’s deductive chain will be false, in which case, by HCCW, such a possibility counts as close. If closeness of worlds is cashed out in terms of HCCW, then Plumpton does not know PN if he deduced it from PN-1, which is effectively the denial of single-premise closure for whenever the chance that the next step will be false is high enough (for example, the step leading from PN-1 to PN in Plumpton’s case) the deduction from that previous step will be ruled out as unsafe. The same problem arises for knowing a proposition at the end of a very long testimony or memory chain when there is a non-zero objective probability that the process will go astray at any given link of the chain.

Moreover, HCCW also struggles to explain the inconsistency of why, in some cases, we do attribute knowledge to agents concerning events with substantially low probabilities of occurring while in some case we do not. For instance, we are happy to say, following Greco (2007) and Vogel (1999), that a veteran cop knows that his rookie partner will fail to disarm the mugger by shooting a bullet down the barrel of the mugger’s gun, or that not all sixty golfers will score a hole-in-one on the par three hole, or that this monkey will not type out a copy of War and Peace if placed in front of a computer. Yet it is common to deny knowledge in the lottery case where the chances are substantially lower.

The safety theorist, therefore, owes us some story about how close worlds calibrate in cases involving objective chance.

i. Williamson’s Response

Williamson denies that there is a straightforward correlation between safety and objective probability. When it comes to knowledge there are two conceptions of safety that one can have—a no risk conception or a small risk conception. Williamson (2009d) rejects the latter owing to the way we use the concepts of safety and danger in ordinary, non-epistemic contexts. By way of argument, Williamson (ibid.: 11) asks us to consider the following two valid arguments that involve the use of our ordinary, non-epistemic concept “safe,” where the context is held fixed between premises and conclusion:

Argument Asafety S was shot
───────────────────────
S was not safe from being shot

 

Argument Bsafety S was safe from being shot by X
S was safe from being shot by Y
S was safe from being shot by Z
S was safe from being shot other than by X, Y, or Z
───────────────────────────
S was safe from being shot

Williamson then asks us to consider which of the two competing conception of safety (the “small risk” or “no risk”) secures the validity of these arguments by plugging in these conceptions in the relevant premises and conclusions:

Argument Asmall risk S was shot
─────────────────────────
S’s risk of being shot was not small  

 

Argument Bsmall risk S’s risk of being shot by X was small
S’s risk of being shot by Y was small
S’s risk of being shot by Z was small
S’s risk of being shot other than by X, Y, or Z was small
───────────────────────────────────────
S’s risk of being shot was small

 

Argument Ano risk S was shot
───────────────────────────
S was at some risk of being shot

 

Argument Bno risk S was at no risk of being shot by X
S was at no risk of being shot by Y
S was at no risk of being shot by Z
S was at no risk of being shot by other than X, Y, or Z
──────────────────────────────────────
S was at no risk of being shot

With regards to the “small risk” conception of safety, the argument A small risk is invalid since even events with a small risk of occurring in a world W do occur in W, for example, lottery wins. Argument B small risk is invalid because small risks add up to large ones. On the other hand, the “no risk” conception of safety fairs much better for these reasons. Since S was shot in some world close to W, and W being the closest world to itself, S was at some risk of being shot, which demonstrates the validity of Argument A no risk. This explains why S is not safe from being shot in W at a time T. Similarly, Argument B no risk is valid since if S was not shot by X in any close world to W at T, and so on with respect to Y, or Z or anyone else, then there is no close world in which S was shot. This exercise with the ordinary conception of safety demonstrates that the ordinary conception thereof is not in terms of small risk or probability. (Peacocke (1999: 310-11) likewise understands the concept of safety in this way: “The relevant kind of possibility is one under which something’s not being possible means that in a certain way one can rely on its not obtaining” (original emphasis).) Therefore, argues Williamson, the notion of a safe belief is not one correlated with probability.

In light of this divergence between safety and probability, one counts as safely believing a conjunction, by Williamson’s lights,  if and only if one safely believes the conjunction on a basis that includes safely believing each conjunct. Similarly, if one safely believes P and safely believes PQ, then one safely believes Q if and only if the basis on which one believes Q includes the basis on which one believes P and PQ, for in that case there will be no close world in which one believes Q and Q is false. It stands to reason then, that there will be cases in which S safely believes P and safely believes PQ, yet does not safely believe Q since the basis on which S believes the latter does not include the basis of the former two beliefs. One must safely derive that which is entailed by what one already safely believes before one counts as safely believing the entailment: “We might say that safe derivation means that one makes a ‘knowledgeable’ connection from premises to conclusion, rather than that one knows the connection” (Williamson 2009d: 27).

Given these arguments, Williamson (ibid.: 19), demonstrates that in some cases knowing and objective probability dramatically diverge. For example, suppose I designate the winning lottery ticket “Lucky” and then believe that Lucky will win the lottery (where “Lucky” is a rigid designator). Nonetheless, I count as knowing in advance that Lucky will win despite each ticket having the very same low probability of winning.

For these reasons the cases involving knowledge of risky propositions do not bother a no risk conception of safety so long as one safely believes the conjunction on a basis that includes the bases on which one safely believes each conjunct. The same applies to very lengthy derivations. It stands to reason, then, that Plumpton knows PN despite there being a very high objective probability that PN is false. And so long as there is no close world in which one falsely believes a proposition P about the future, then one safely believes P despite there being a non-zero-probability that P is false, for example, that no monkey will type out War and Peace, that not all sixty golfers will score a hole-in-one, or that the rookie will not disarm the mugger. With respect to knowledge of the future, Williamson (2009c: 327) writes that “the occurrence of an event in β that bucks a relevant trend in α may be a relevant lack of closeness between α and β, even though the trend falls well short of a being a strict law.” Trends are further indicators of closeness between cases. So in a case α an agent S can be in a position to know a proposition P about the future even though there is a non-zero probability that P will be false since the case β in which it is false is sufficiently distant from α owing to P’s being false in β bucking a trend in α.

Matters involving lottery puzzles remain troublesome for Williamson, however. In the cases where the known proposition entails a risky proposition about the future for example, that one will be healthy for the rest of the year, Williamson is happy to admit that one does safely believe that risky proposition given the divergence between safety and small risk (as explained above). However, this seems to indicate that Williamson is happy to permit that one can safely infer that one’s lottery ticket will lose, which is problematic since it contradicts a widely-held intuition and goes against Williamson’s prior commitment in print that one does not know that one’s ticket will lose (2000: 117, 247). In conversation Williamson has made two salient remarks in response to these points. First, he still maintains that one does not know one’s ticket will lose when this belief is formed on the basis of reflecting on the low odds of it winning. He is open to one’s knowing that one’s ticket will lose by other bases of belief, for example, safe derivation from known propositions about the future. So in some lottery puzzles Williamson will concede that one can know that one’s ticket will lose. Second, Williamson has emphasized that lottery puzzles are unstable since one readily attributes knowledge about the future only to retract it when the lottery entailment becomes salient. Since Williamson’s concerns are the structural features of knowledge, he is not overly perturbed by problems generated by specific cases which rest on very unstable intuitions.

ii. Pritchard’s Response

Pritchard (2008: 41; 2009: 29), like Williamson, argues that the relationship between objective probability and safety is not one of direct correlation but motivates his claim using intuitions from a different lottery case. We say that S does not know by reflecting on the extremely long odds of winning a lottery that her ticket will lose (even if the draw has already occurred and S is unaware of the results) but that S does know that it lost from reading the result in the newspaper. This is a somewhat surprising result given that the objective probability of being wrong in the former case is lower than in the latter case since newspapers do sometimes print errors. Were closeness determined according to the HCCW principle, the the intuitions should be the converse. Safety, argues Pritchard, captures the intuitions in this case since the world in which one wins a lottery is very much like the actual world since all that differentiates the two worlds in this context is a bunch of balls falling differently. That is why one cannot know that one’s ticket will lose. However, given the copious editing processes at newspapers, quite a bit would have to go wrong for there to be a printing error.

Using this understanding of closeness Pritchard believes he can answer the lottery puzzles Hawthorne raises. Pritchard contends that we are mistaken in thinking that these are puzzles because our intuitions are being misled by a lack of detail in the presentation of the cases (ibid. 43-8). If S has a lottery ticket in his pocket for a draw taking place tomorrow, Pritchard claims that we ought to resist attributing knowledge to S that he won’t have enough money to go on a safari this year since the world in which he wins a major prize in the forthcoming lottery is close. In such a case, argues Pritchard, the agent also does not know that his ticket will lose. Conversely, if S does not have a lottery ticket in hand, then S knows he won’t go on safari and knows that he won’t win the lottery. Either way closure is preserved.

In a similar fashion Pritchard argues away some of the other lottery-like puzzles. If we are told that S is a healthy person then we are prone to affirm that S knows that S will be living in Wyoming this coming year and that S knows that S won’t have a heart attack since the world in which S, a healthy person drops dead from a totally unexpected heart attack, is far off. Likewise, if we are told that S has very high cholesterol, then we will deny that S knows that S will be living in Wyoming this year and that S won’t have a heart attack. Closure is maintained in both cases.

Some might have reservations about the adequacy of Pritchard’s response, however. It is a matter of differing intuitions whether or not there is a relevant difference between the actual world and worlds in which perfectly healthy people die from a sudden and unexpected heart attack or are involved in a fatal car accident. If such worlds are relevantly similar to the actual world, then such worlds should accordingly count as close on Pritchard’s line of thought. Therefore, contrary to Pritchard, such agents should be denied knowledge of their future whereabouts. The same line of reasoning can be applied to the lottery and newspaper case; the world in which the type setting machine prints an error owing to a technical glitch is much closer to the actual world than the world in which the seven balls corresponding to the numbers on one’s lottery ticket fall into the dedicated slots because much less has to change in the former case than in the latter case. If closeness of worlds is determined by how much the two worlds actually differ on the details of the case, then one ought to be unable to know stuff by reading the newspaper, which is an untenable result. Finally, it is also unclear how Pritchard’ strategy can handle the troublesome cases involving multi-premise closure that Hawthorne and Lasonen-Aarnio describe. The world in which Plumpton makes a mistake in the very long deductive chain he is about to embark upon seems very similar to the actual world. A natural reading of “at each step the chance that he will make a mistake is exceedingly low but that he will make a mistake overall exceedingly high” is that the two worlds are very similar; not much change is required for Plumpton to make a mistake somewhere along the way.

Despite these concerns, the disparity between closeness and objective probability that Pritchard is urging does seem to handle the Vogel and Greco cases quite well. Events in the actual would have to change significantly for sixty golfers all to score holes-in-one, or for the rookie to disarm the mugger, or for the monkey to type War and Peace.  The angles of the club face, timing, ball spin, wind speeds, strength of swing, and so forth. would all have to somehow fall together in such a way on sixty different occasions for all sixty golfers to succeed in scoring holes-in-one. Similar thoughts apply to the rookie and monkey cases.

c. Safety and Determinism

The safety theorist argues that if S knows P then S could not have easily been wrong. Suppose, for the sake of argument, that our world is a deterministic world  in the sense that the state of the world at TN is determined by the state of the world at TN—1 plus the laws of nature.. In what sense, then, could S have easily gone wrong since, if determinism is true, S could not but have believed P truly? Williamson (2000: 124, 2009: 325) argues that “determinism does not trivialize safety.” Williamson demonstrates this point by way of an example of a ball balanced on the tip of a cone. Such a ball, even in a deterministic world, is not safe from falling because, argues Williamson, the initial conditions could easily have been different such that the ball falls. By the “initial conditions” he means “the time of the case, not to the beginning of the universe” (2000: 124).

The suggestion, then, seems to be that in a case α in a deterministic world W, S safely believes P if and only if had the initial conditions of the case been slightly different S would still have truly believed P. What remains unclear, however, is why Williamson says that only the initial conditions of the case need to be changed and not the initial conditions of the universe, for, after all, altering the initial conditions of the case in a deterministic world can only be achieved if one alters the initial conditions of the universe itself. So altering the initial conditions of the case necessitates altering the initial conditions of the universe. In addition, on some conceptions of determinism, small scale changes at the beginning of the universe generate large-scale changes further down the chain of events. Consequently, it is unclear whether altering the initial conditions of the universe will generate sufficiently similar cases in which S falsely believes P. Finally, it seems somewhat odd to say that even if the actual world is a deterministic world, then even though I am currently typing in Oxford I could just have easily been hunting bears in Mongolia since a slight alteration in the initial conditions of the universe would have resulted in my being a bear hunter.

One maneuver a safety theorist can make in response to the foregoing difficulties is to adopt a move Lewis makes in his work on the semantics of counterfactuals. Suppose a world W is a deterministic world and in a case α in W S truly believes P at T. The safety theorist could argue that S safely believes P at T in W if and only if had there been a small miracle at T or some time shortly before T such that different conditions prevailed in a case β very similar to α, S truly believes P. (Williamson has raised such an option in conversation.)

Some might be wary of such a metaphysics since they would assume that miracles are not the kind of things we want in our ontology or epistemology. So it appears that unless the safety theorist wishes to adopt a somewhat unorthodox metaphysics, safety, despite Williamson’s insistence to the contrary, is hostage to determinism. But in the safety theorist’s defense, our best physics seems to provide a better case for indeterminism than determinism. It remains the case, nevertheless, that the safety theorist needs be more forthcoming about the relationship between the physical conditions of the world and the modality of the safety condition.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. 1973. Belief, Truth, and Knowledge. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • An important early contribution to the study of knowledge in the post-Gettier period, particularly the idea that knowledge requires reliability.
  • Chisholm, R. 1977. Theory of Knowledge. 2nd ed. NJ: Prentice Hall.
    • One of the notable works in the early period of contemporary analytic epistemology.
  • Comesaña, J. 2005. “Unsafe Knowledge.” Synthese 146: 395-404.
    • This author argues that safe belief is not necessary for knowledge.
  • Dretske, F. 1971. “Conclusive Reasons.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 49: 1-22.
    • In this paper Dretske argues for a sensitivity condition for knowledge.
  • Gettier, E. 1963. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis 23: 121-3.
    • Here the famous counterexamples to the justified true belief account of knowledge are presented.
  • Goldman, A. 1967. “A Causal Theory of Knowing.” The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (12): 357-372.
    • Goldman presents a causal account of knowledge, which was an early attempt at solving the Gettier problem. Goldman later abounded this account in favor of his relevant alternatives account, a position he still maintains today.
  • Goldman, A.  1976. “Discrimination and Perceptual Knowledge.” The Journal of Philosophy, 73: 771-91.
    • The relevant alternatives condition for knowledge is explicated and defended.
  • Goldman, A. 1986. Epistemology and Cognition. USA: Harvard University Press.
    • A contemporary classic that presents Goldman’s epistemics—his multidisciplinary project of bringing the developments in cognitive psychology to bear on questions in individual and social epistemology.
  • Goldman, A. 2007. “Philosophical Intuitions: Their Target, Their Source, and Their Epistemic Status.”  Grazer Philosophische Studien 74: 1-26.
    • In this paper Goldman discusses the place of intuition in philosophy and the epistemic status of such intuitions, which is currently a hot topic in epistemology.
  • Greco, J. 2007. “Worries about Pritchard’s Safety.” Synthese 158: 299-302.
    • Problems for Pritchard’s safety condition are raised.
  • Hawthorne, J. 2004. Knowledge and Lotteries. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • This is a masterful treatment of the lottery problem and includes a helpful comparative assessment of the various semantic solutions proposed to this problem.
  • Hawthorne, J. & Gendler, T. 2005. “The Real Guide to Fake Barns.” Philosophical Studies 124: 331-352.
    • A humorous and pointed display of how some Gettier cases can be manipulated into yield even tougher cases for accounts of knowledge to handle.
  • Hawthorne, J. & Lasonen-Aarnio, M. 2009. “Knowledge and Objective Chance”. In: Greenough, P. & Pritchard, D. (eds.). Williamson on Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 92-108.
    • In this piece the problematic relationship between safety and probability is identified.
  • Lackey, J. 2006. “Pritchard’s Epistemic Luck.” Philosophical Quarterly 56: 284-9.
    • This author argues for inadequacies in Pritchard’s work on safety.
  • Lewis, D. 1973. Counterfactuals. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Here Lewis presents his modal semantics for counterfactuals.
  • McGinn, C. 1999. “The Concept of Knowledge.” In: McGinn, C. Knowledge and Reality: Selected Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 7-35.
    • In this collection of his essays, McGinn defends his favored account of knowledge.
  • Neta, R. & Rohrbaugh, G. “Luminosity and the Safety of Knowledge.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 85 (2004) 396–406.
    • Arguments against safety are presented.
  • Nozick, R. 1981. Philosophical Explanations. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Chapter 3 contains Nozick’s defense of his sensitivity condition for knowledge.
  • Peacocke, C. 1999. Being Known. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • In §7.5 Peacocke presents a useful elaboration of the notion of “could easily have.”
  • Pritchard, D. 2005. Epistemic Luck. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A masterful exposition of the place luck plays in epistemology.
  • Pritchard, D. 2007. “Anti-Luck Epistemology.” Synthese 158: 277-98.
    • An argument for a refined safety condition for knowledge.
  • Pritchard, D. 2008. “Knowledge, Luck, and Lotteries.” In: Hendricks, V. & Pritchard, D. (eds.). New Waves in Epistemology. London: Palgrave Macmillan, pp. 28-51.
    • Here Pritchard discusses the lottery problem for safety at length.
  • Pritchard, D. 2009a. “Safety-Based Epistemology: Whither Now?” Journal of Philosophical Research 34: 33-45.
    • Further refinements of the safety condition.
  • Pritchard, D. 2009b. Knowledge. London: Palgrave Macmillan
    • A general and accessible introduction to knowledge.
  • Russell, B. 1948. Human Knowledge: Its Scope and its Limits. London: Allen & Unwin.
    • Here Russell lays out a general treatment of human knowledge part of which discusses his famous clock case.
  • Sainsbury, R.M. 1997. “Easy Possibilities.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 57(4): 907-919.
    • A discussion of easy possibility with respect to S not easily falsely believing P.
  • Shope, R. 1983. An Analysis of Knowing: A Decade of Research. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • A helpful overview of the early post-Gettier literature.
  • Skyrms, F.B. 1967. “The Explication of ‘X knows that P’.” Journal of Philosophy 64: 373-89.
    • An early work in epistemology in the post-Gettier period.
  • Sosa, E. 1999a. “How to Defeat Opposition to Moore.” Philosophical Perspectives 13: 141-54.
    • A discussion of safety in the context of skepticism.
  • Sosa, E. 1999b. “How must knowledge be modally related to what is known?” Philosophical Topics 26 (1&2): 373-384.
    • Sosa argues that a contraposition of Nozick’s sensitivity condition of knowledge is a superior condition for knowledge.
  • Sosa, E. 2007. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge Volume I. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sosa, E. 2009. Reflective Knowledge: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge Volume II. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • In these two publications Sosa develops and refines his work on safety into a virtue account of knowledge that does not lean so heavily on a “brute” safety condition for knowledge. As a result, Sosa (and Pritchard) can no longer be strictly labeled as a safety theorist. Indeed, Sosa is open to there being cases of lucky knowledge.
  • Vogel, J. 1999. “The New Relative Alternative Theory”. Philosophical Perspectives 13: 155-80.
    • Here one finds, among other things, some interesting cases involving luck.
  • Williamson, T. 1994. Vagueness. London: Routledge.
    • Here Williamson presents a  case for his epistemic conception of vagueness.
  • Williamson, T. 2000. Knowledge and its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A contemporary classic in epistemology in which Williamson argues for some rather iconoclastic positions about knowledge and evidence, among other important questions.
  • Williamson, T. 2009a. “Reply to Cassam.” In: Greenough, P. & Pritchard, D. (eds.). Williamson on Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 285-292.
    • This is a collection of concerns several authors raise about various aspects of Williamson’s work in epistemology. The book concludes with Williamson’s replies.
  • Williamson, T. 2009b. “Reply to Goldman.” In: Greenough, P. & Pritchard, D. (eds.). Williamson on Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 305-312.
  • Williamson, T. 2009c. “Reply to John Hawthorne and Maria Lasonen-Aarnio.” In: Greenough, P. & Pritchard, D. (eds.). Williamson on Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 313-29.
  • Williamson, T. 2009d. “Probability and Danger.” The Amherst Lecture in Philosophy.
    • A clarification of the relationship between safe belief and probability.

 

Author Information

Dani Rabinowitz
Email: dani.rabinowitz@philosophy.ox.ac.uk
Oxford University
United Kingdom

Epistemic Entitlement

In the early 1990s there emerged a growing interest with the concept of epistemic entitlement. Philosophers who acknowledge the existence of entitlements maintain that there are beliefs or judgments unsupported by evidence available to the subject, but which the subject nonetheless has the epistemic right to hold. Some of these may include beliefs non-inferentially sourced in perception, memory, introspection, testimony, and the a priori.  Unlike the traditional notion of justification, entitlement is often characterized as an externalist type of epistemic warrant, in the sense that a subject’s being entitled is determined by facts and circumstances that are independent of any reasoning capacities she may or may not have, and which the subject herself need not understand or be able to recognize. One key motivation for this view is that the inclusion of entitlement in epistemology can account for the commonly held intuition that largely unreflective individuals, such as children and non-human animals, possess warrant and basic knowledge about the world.  It also paves the way for a tenable foundationalist epistemology, according to which there exist warranted beliefs which are not themselves warranted or justified by any further beliefs.  This article explores theories of entitlement as presented by four prominent philosophers: Fred Dretske, Tyler Burge, Crispin Wright, and Christopher Peacocke.

Table of Contents

  1. Dretske on Entitlement
  2. Burge on Entitlement
  3. Wright on Entitlement
  4. Peacocke on Entitlement
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Dretske on Entitlement

Fred Dretske has argued for the existence of epistemic entitlements.  Like justification, entitlement is an epistemic property of belief which, when the belief is true (and the subject is not in a Gettier-style situation), constitutes knowledge.  Much of Dretske’s work on this topic rises out of his (2000) article: “Entitlements: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?”  Part of understanding his view involves having a grasp of the question being posed in the article’s title.  Unlike justifications, entitlements are epistemic rights we have to believe various propositions without having any added requirements to engage, or be able to engage, in some sophisticated mental exercise.  Considering what is included in the conception of justification, the traditional answer suggests that being justified is a matter of fulfilling various epistemic duties or obligations.  Some of these duties may include: gathering ample evidence, arriving at beliefs carefully and methodically, deliberating over the strength of one’s supportive reasons, and so forth.  For instance, if it is true that Detective Johnson is justified in believing

GUILTY: Smith is guilty of the murder,

then it must be that she has good reasons for thinking GUILTY true, reasons of which she herself is aware and could appeal to if she needed to defend her belief.  Johnson's reasons may be, for example, that Smith’s fingerprints were on the murder weapon and Smith had strong motive to kill.  Though these sorts of epistemic requirements obtain for beliefs like GUILTY (as we shall assume), Dretske thinks there are other sorts of beliefs you and I have which: (1) amount to genuine knowledge, but that also (2) are not justified in the sense just described.  Consider your perceptual belief that

BRIGHT: There is a bright screen ahead of me,

or a memorial belief that

ATE: I ate breakfast this morning.

Given that you know these propositions, it seems too strong a condition that you must recognize that which provides the epistemic support for these beliefs, or be in a position to defend them by way of some argument.  Additionally, many philosophers think that children and lower animals have perceptual and memorial knowledge, yet they lack the conceptual skills needed to be able to think about what it is that gives them this knowledge.  The point is that the conditions for acquiring a justification for a belief like GUILTY are harder to satisfy than they are for acquiring an entitlement for a belief like BRIGHT.  Thus, Dretske holds that there exists a kind of epistemic good that attaches to our various perceptual beliefs and memorial beliefs (and perhaps others) but which is distinct from the traditional notion of justification.  This epistemic good is what he calls entitlement.  To have an entitlement is to have the epistemic right to believe a proposition in which the possessor need not be consciously reflective of that which awards the entitlement.  (Notice that the relevant kinds of beliefs Dretske has in mind, like BRIGHT or ATE, are about things in the outer world, not our own conscious experiences or memories.)

In this way epistemic entitlements are analogous to various legal or constitutional rights we have.  There is no added physical effort or labor you had to exert to be awarded the right to vote in the U.S. presidential election; you have this right solely in virtue of having the status of being a U.S. citizen and at least eighteen years old.  Indeed, you have this right whether or not you know that you do.  The same goes for one’s right to the property bequeathed by a passing family member.  The recipient did not have to do anything to “earn” her entitlement to that property; that she is simply listed in the will suffices.  Similarly, what gives people the epistemic right, or entitlement, to hold various beliefs is determined by circumstances independent of any reasoning capacities they may or may not have.  A subject may have an entitlement to her belief even if she is unaware that she has it.

Before proceeding, note that Dretske is operating with a narrow characterization of justification.  He thinks that justification is an epistemically internalist notion in the sense that to be justified in holding a belief, there must be some proposition (or propositions) one already believes and which one has reflective access to and could be used to justify that belief.  On the other hand, entitlement receives an externalist characterization in the sense that one can have an entitlement without having access to that which makes one entitled.  It is worth mentioning, however, that not all epistemologists understand justification in the way Dretske does.  Whereas for Dretske, the things that do the justifying are other beliefs one has, some internalists allow other sorts of mental states, like perceptual experiences and memories, to count as reasons or justifications (Audi 1993 and Pryor 2000).  Also, some philosophers prefer to use ‘internalism’ simply as the claim that the things that justify a belief are internal to one’s mental life.  One could be an internalist about justification in this weaker sense, which is commonly referred to as mentalism (see Conee and Feldman 2003), without requiring that one be able to access or become aware of one’s justifying mental states or to believe that these states are reliable.  Thus, according to a mentalist, a child may be justified in believing BRIGHT, provided that it is properly grounded in her experience of a bright screen ahead, even if the child does not herself recognize her experience as that which makes her justified.  The point is that Dretskean entitlement, if it is a distinctive epistemic concept, differs from justification only as understood in Dretske’s restricted sense of the term as that of being backed by other beliefs to which one could appeal in support of one’s belief.

The main question Dretske wishes to answer is: if there are things we are entitled to accept as true, what grounds this entitlement?  In other words, what entitles us to believe various propositions?  It is important to emphasize that these are questions posed specifically to philosophers; entitled subjects themselves need not know, and quite often do not know, the answer to them.  Dretske begins his answer by distancing his view of entitlement from a pure reliabilist view that one has the epistemic right to the belief that p if and only if the belief that p was produced by a reliable process.  For a pure reliabilist, given that your perceptual system produced your belief that BRIGHT, and assuming that perception yields true beliefs on most occasions, you are epistemically permitted to hold this belief.  But according to Dretske, there are (at least) two reasons why entitlement must not be associated with this form of reliabilism.  First, one can surely hold what is in fact a reliably-produced belief while at the same time having independent reasons for doubting its truth (for example, you have evidence that you’ve taken a mind-altering drug, yet you continue to trust your senses as they indicate a three-foot bumble bee).  To maintain the belief in such a situation would, intuitively, be irrational on the subject’s part, which, it seems, would thereby strip the subject of her epistemic right to that belief.  However, by concentrating entirely on the reliability of a belief-forming process, a pure reliabilist cannot accommodate this intuition.  Entitlement must therefore be understood as a defeasible epistemic right, one that can be defeated by countervailing evidence.  Secondly, Dretske holds that entitlements supervene on the subjective resources of the subject.  This implies that two subjects with identical psychological make-ups cannot differ with respect to the entitlements they possess (For this reason, it is plausible that Dretskean entitlement has an element of internalism, but only of the weaker, mentalist sort described above).  For example, suppose there is some being who has the exact same experiences, beliefs, methods of reasoning, and so forth, as you do.  Suppose further that this “mental twin” of yours is, unbeknownst to her, nothing but a bodiless brain in a vat whose experiences are systematically being fed by a powerful supercomputer.  While your perceptual system is highly reliable (as we shall assume), your twin’s system is massively unreliable, because all of her experiences and corresponding beliefs are erroneous.  According to a pure reliabilist, then, whereas you have the epistemic right to believe BRIGHT when you have an experience of a bright screen before you, your envatted twin lacks the right to BRIGHT when she has the exact same experience.  Dretske, however, thinks that this is the wrong result. (The sort of case described here is commonly referred to as the New Evil Demon Problem, first introduced by Lehrer & Cohen 1983.)  He thinks it is intuitively correct that your twin has the right to believe whatever you have a right to believe, even if your beliefs are true and her’s false.  You have knowledge and your twin lacks it because knowledge requires truth and your twin’s beliefs are false; however, it seems that the unfortunate twin still retains some epistemic good.  The correct account of entitlement should allow for this intuition and therefore be suited to award entitlements to subjects who are in unfavorable, illusory environments. (Although the New Evil Demon Problem does pose a challenge to the pure version of reliabilism Dretske considers, it bears mentioning that several philosophers have advanced other versions of reliabilism which purport to avoid this problem.  See, for instance, Bach 1985, Goldman 1988, Comesaña 2002, Majors and Sawyer 2005.)

If the concept of entitlement is not grounded in the reliability of a belief-forming process, what is it grounded in?  Dretske argues that we have entitlements to beliefs which are psychologically immediate and irresistible to us.  There are certain sorts of beliefs over which we have no choice whether we hold them or not.  Perceptual beliefs are a prime example.  As you gaze your eyes on a computer screen, your visual experience of a bright screen causes you to believe BRIGHT.  The causal sequence between experience and belief is simply out of your control, and it occurs much too quickly to avoid it.  This fact about our psychologies, that we cannot resist some of our beliefs, is what accounts for our entitlements.  As Dretske says, “We have a right to accept what we are powerless to reject” (2000, p. 598).  In saying this, Dretske appeals to the well-known principle that ‘Ought implies Can’.  Given that you are unable to refrain from believing BRIGHT, it would be unreasonable to suppose that you epistemically ought not to believe it.  If this is correct, then we can see how your brain-in-a-vat twin is entitled to believe BRIGHT.  Although her experience of the screen is inaccurate, and her perceptual system is unreliable, she enjoys an entitlement to her belief because she is equally as compelled to form the belief as you are.

Entitlements are defeated when the formation of a belief is avoidable, that is, when there are things the subject could have done, or more precisely, should have done that would have prevented her from being caused to believe.  Suppose, for example, that you have independent evidence from a credible source that you are now looking at a well-crafted poster of a computer screen instead of a real one.  Suppose further that you disregard this evidence, so that when you have the experience of a bright screen you are caused to believe BRIGHT.  In this sort of case you lack an entitlement to this belief, because had you been properly responsive to the evidence in your possession, your experience would have failed to cause you to believe BRIGHT.  One might interject here that this suggestion runs contrary to Dretske’s original proposal, because even though you have ignored the countervailing evidence, you still cannot avoid being compelled to believe BRIGHT when you had the experience.  In response, Dretske maintains that entitlements should be reserved only for those beliefs that an epistemically responsible agent could not avoid being caused to form in similar circumstances.  Because of this, given that you have this evidence, you epistemically ought to refrain from believing BRIGHT.  Analogously, when a drunk driver accidentally runs over a child in the street, it may be that the driver is, at that time, in a situation where hitting the child was unavoidable.  We do not say, though, that the driver therefore had the right to run over the child.  The reason the driver is culpable for the accident is that were she more responsible, she would have taken measures to ensure that she did not get into the situation in the first place (for example, by taking a taxi home rather than driving).  Similarly, even if you cannot avoid being caused by your experience to believe BRIGHT, your entitlement to that belief is stripped because a responsible agent in that same circumstance, recognizing that she has evidence that she is looking at a computer-screen poster, would have avoided being so caused.

We will now consider two objections to Dretske’s view.  First, Michael Williams (2000) rejects Dretske’s contention that epistemic rights can exist in the complete absence of any epistemic duties.  Given that Dretske takes entitlements to be defeasible rights, it is plausible that were one’s belief challenged by another person, that would cancel the entitlement one had to that belief.  The only way to re-establish the entitlement, it seems, would be by providing reasons that defeat the challenge.  If this is right, it suggests that Dretske overstates his position that entitlements are completely free of justificational obligations.  While it may be correct that we need not actively provide positive evidential backing for every belief to which we are entitled, having an entitlement requires that one at least be able to justify or defend one’s belief in situations when one is presented with an appropriate challenge.  As Williams notes, defeasibility and justificational commitments go together.  The result, presumably, is that most young children and unreflective adults would lack entitlements to many of their perceptual and memorial beliefs, for they may lack the cognitive resources needed to be able to defend their own beliefs. However, this is a result some philosophers are willing to accept.

As for the second objection, many philosophers think that insofar as entitlements are epistemic goods that contribute to knowledge, they must be suitably connected to truth; they must be truth-conducive, or have a sufficiently high likelihood of being true.  But this suggestion appears to be at odds with Dretske’s claim that your brain-in-a-vat mental twin, whose beliefs are almost all false, is entitled to the same beliefs that you are.  One way epistemologists sometimes react to the New Evil Demon Problem is to draw a distinction between two kinds of epistemic standings: being epistemically blameless for holding a belief, on the one hand, and being fully entitled (or justified or warranted) in holding a belief, such that having this property makes an essential contribution to knowledge, on the other (see Pryor 2001).  According to this distinction, whereas you are entitled to the belief (and also know) that BRIGHT, your envatted twin is merely blameless when she forms the same belief.  It is through no fault of her own that she arrives at a false, unreliably-produced belief; nonetheless, she lacks an epistemic right which you possess.  She is simply unlucky that her experiences and beliefs are not connected to the external world in the proper way.

In response to this charge, one could claim that the envatted subject’s beliefs are conducive to truth, but only relative to more favorable environments (see Goldman 1986 and Henderson & Horgan 2006).  Given that the brain in a vat is a responsible agent, her beliefs would be mostly true if she were in an environment similar to the actual one.  Alternatively, one could deny that a distinction between being blameless and being entitled (or justified or warranted) exists at all.  The suggestion would be that to be justly entitled is for you (or an epistemically responsible agent) to be blameless in holding the belief (for defenders of this move see Ginet 1975, Chisholm 1977, and Bonjour 1985; for objections see Alston 1989a).  Whether either of these options have promise, however, is something that Dretske would need to argue for.

2. Burge on Entitlement

Tyler Burge has argued that “[w]e are entitled to rely, other things equal, on perception, memory, deductive and inductive reasoning, and on…the word of others” (1993, p. 458).  Because his work on perceptual entitlement is arguably the most developed, we shall focus our attention on perceptual beliefs: beliefs non-inferentially based on a perceptual experience.

Burge begins by introducing the concept of warrant, which he says is the most fundamental type of epistemic good.  What makes it specifically an epistemic good is that a belief’s being warranted depends first and foremost on its being a good route to truth.  Yet, it also depends on the subject’s own limitations: what information the subject has; what information is available; and how well that information is used.  Thus, when he says warrant must be a good route to truth, he does not mean that warranted beliefs necessarily are true; one can be warranted in a belief which happens to be false.  Nonetheless, the warranted subject must, at a minimum, be well-positioned to achieve truth.  Being warranted entails being reliable, that is, the productive warranted belief has a sufficiently high likelihood of being true (at least under normal circumstances).

Warrant is divided into two sub-species.  The first is justification.  Justification is epistemically internalist in the sense that it is warrant by reason that is conceptually accessible upon reflection to the subject.  Beliefs we are justified in holding are those that result from having engaged in reasoning or from having drawn an inference from other beliefs (Consider again the example from the previous section in which Johnson infers that Smith is guilty on the basis of her reasons that Smith’s fingerprints were on the murder weapon and he had motive to kill).  But when we turn to the epistemology of perceptual belief, Burge thinks the transition from a perceptual state (for example, seeing a round and red apple on the table) to a belief (for example, APPLE: There is round and red apple there) is nothing at all like drawing an inference.  In most typical situations, we do not reason our way from experience to belief; hence the warrant for our perceptual beliefs must not come in the form of justification.  There are two primary reasons why Burge thinks this is so.  First, reasoning is a sophisticated, intellectual mental exercise.  The capacities necessary for reasoning are too complex for us to plausibly attribute them to certain groups of individuals, like children and higher non-human animals.  If justification were the only form of warrant that there is, these individuals’ perceptual beliefs would lack warrant; yet it is commonly thought that these individuals are no less warranted in their perceptual beliefs than mature adults are.  The second reason why it’s wrong to think we reason from experience to belief is that reasoning essentially involves progressing from one or more propositional attitudes one has, like a belief, to another as one would draw a conclusion from the premises of an argument.  But Burge argues that perceptual states are not propositional attitudes.  In other words, perception has nonpropositional content (see also Evans 1982, Peacock 2001, Heck 2007).  Whereas a belief’s content (or what that belief concerns or is about) has predicational (or sentence-like) structure, perceptual content does not.  The content of a perceptual state is more akin to a topographical map rather than a sentence. (For more on nonpropositional perceptual content, see Peacocke 1992.) Therefore, unlike beliefs, experiences are not the kinds of mental states from which one can draw inferences.  Nonetheless, what is common among beliefs and perceptual states, and unlike other kinds of mental states like wishes and imaginings, is that they are both capable of being veridical: they have accuracy conditions that can be either satisfied or unsatisfied.

Given that perceptual beliefs are not justified in the sense just described, the type of warrant they receive must come under a different form.  This brings us to the second sub-species of warrant: entitlement.  Burgean entitlement is epistemically externalist in the sense that it is warrant that need not be fully conceptually accessible to the subject.  Like Dretskean entitlement, one can have a Burgean entitlement to a perceptual belief, such as APPLE, without knowing or justifiably believing that one does.  Also similar to Dretske’s view is the claim that entitlement is a defeasible kind of epistemic good: it can be defeated by independent reasons one may have for doubting that one’s perceptual faculties are properly functioning or that the believed proposition in question is true.  Thus, absent reasons for doubt, one has an entitlement to conceptualize one’s perceptual experience in the form of a belief (for example, to believe APPLE when one has an experience of a round, red apple).

As one clarification, Burge’s claim is not that entitlement is the only kind of warrant that can attach to perceptual beliefs.  People certainly can, and do, reason and deliberate about these sorts of beliefs.  One can think, for example: “There appears to be a round and red apple, and when things appear this way they generally turn out to be accurate.  Therefore, there is a round and red apple there.”  This is a perfectly permissible way to reason, and doing so can result in acquiring a justification in addition to the perceptual entitlement one already possesses.  The crucial point is that securing a warrant for this belief does not require that one reasons, or be able to reason, in this way.  To impose such a requirement on all forms of warrant would result, as Burge says, in hyper-intellectualizing perceptual belief.

The key question Burge wants to answer is: What is the contribution of perceptual states per se to entitlements to perceptual beliefs?  He thinks that two conditions must be met in order for a perceptual state to award the subject the epistemic right to believe as that state represents the world as being.  To understand what these conditions are, it is important first to appreciate Burge’s claim that the perceptual system has a characteristic function.  Some philosophers have argued that the function of any natural system can only be understood in terms of how it contributes to meeting the basic biological needs of the organism (see Millikan 1984).  For example, on this view the perceptual system functions well only insofar as it enables the perceiver to identify mates, avoid predators, find food, and so on.  Burge, however, distances himself from this sort of explanation.  He holds instead that it is known on a priori grounds that the perceptual system is a representational system that has the function to represent the subject’s environment veridically and reliably (2003, p. 508).  Although he agrees that reliable perception can, and oftentimes does, contribute to satisfying one’s biological needs (for example, being able to perceptually discriminate different colors can help one spot red berries to eat in a green forest), it is a mistake for philosophers to attempt to reduce the perceptual system’s function or explain it solely in terms of biological fitness.  The sense in which the perceptual system “has done a good job” in a given situation should be evaluated in terms of its capacity for producing veridical perceptual states.

Provided that this is the perceptual system’s function, there is the further question of how the system is capable of producing states that accurately represent the environment.  Burge’s answer centers on the thesis of perceptual anti-individualism (sometimes called perceptual content externalism).  According to this thesis, the nature of a perceptual state (what that state represents) is partially determined by a history of causal interactions that have occurred between objects and properties in the environment, on the one hand, and the perceiver, or the perceiver’s evolutionary ancestors, on the other (see Burge 2003; 2005, Section I; 2007, Introduction; 2007a).  What explains the fact that you are capable of (accurately or inaccurately) perceptually representing, say, shapes like roundness and colors like redness in the environment is that you, within your own lifetime, or your ancestors throughout the evolution of the species, regularly came into contact with various features in the environment, such as instances of these very shapes and colors.  According to the view, these causal interactions help to establish the principles that govern the formation of the perceptual system’s states and inform the perceptual system of what it ought to represent when it is presented, in a given situation, with some array of stimuli (for example, light waves impacting the retina in the eyes or sound waves impacting the ear drums).

Thus one of the conditions that must be met for a perceptual state to confer an entitlement to a corresponding perceptual belief is that the state is anti-individualistically individuated.  The other condition is as follows: one has an entitlement to believe as one’s perceptual state represents the environment as being, only if that type of perceptual state is reliably veridical in the subject’s normal environment.  Burge defines the normal environment as the one in which the contents of the subject’s perceptual states are established.  What this means is that for those perceptual states that do deliver entitlements, the existence of those types of perceptual states (for example, a state indicating roundness or redness) is explained by a history of causal interactions that were highly successful.  That is, one has the general ability to perceptually represent property F because the perceptual system, in its evolutionary development, regularly confronted instances of F-ness in the environment.  Thus, the normal environment might be where one currently lives, but it need not be.  It is possible that the environment a subject currently lives in is different from the one in which her perceptual system evolved, where she, or her ancestors, first acquired the abilities to represent various objects and properties.

The reason why this second condition is important is that entitlement, insofar as it is a type of epistemic warrant, must be a good route to truth.  Provided that perceptual states are established by high degrees of successful interactions with features in the environment, and hence are reliably veridical in the normal environment, “[v]eridicality enters into the very nature of perceptual states and abilities.” (Burge 2003, p. 532) To rely on a particular perceptual state the general type of which was established in this fashion in the formation of a belief makes it likely that that belief is true in the normal environment.

Burge goes on to argue that when these two conditions are met (that is, the perceptual state is anti-individualistically individuated and it is reliably veridical in the normal environment) one has a defeasible entitlement to rely on that state in any environment.  This further point provides a novel solution to the New Evil Demon Problem, which was discussed in the previous section.  Recall that this problem draws on a commonly held intuition that subjects in skeptical situations can hold warranted beliefs.  Suppose you are a regular embodied person, and an apple on the table causes you to have a perceptual experience of a round and red apple, which subsequently causes you to believe APPLE.  At the very next instant you are unknowingly transported to a different world where your brain is placed in a vat, and a computer produces the same experiences you were just having in your regular embodied state.  You have the exact same experience of a round and red apple, except that now the experience is inaccurate (there are no apples nearby, just other brains and computer equipment).  Not only is your belief false, it was produced by an unreliable process relative to this new environment.  Nevertheless, you still possess an entitlement to this belief, because the perceptual state that produced it (that is, your experience of the round and red apple) is reliably veridical, relative to the normal environment.  Because it was interactions with genuine apples (in the actual world) and instances of roundness and redness that helped to establish this type of perceptual state, you retain the epistemic right to believe as your experience represents, even though it is currently not at all indicative of what is going on in this new hostile environment.

We will now consider two criticisms of Burgean entitlement.  As for the first criticism, Burge states explicitly that his view of entitlement is not meant to speak to the problem of skepticism.  His objective is not to prove that we have perceptual entitlements, but rather to explain on the assumption that we do have them what they are.  But some epistemologists might urge that skepticism needs to be addressed in order to get his view off the ground.  Skeptical issues have typically been raised in connection with epistemic closure, which states roughly:

(Closure)    If subject S is warranted in believing that p, and S knows that p logically entails q, and S deduces q on the basis of p, then S is warranted in believing that q.

Suppose I have a warrant in the form of a Burgean perceptual entitlement to believe HAND (that I have hands).  HAND logically entails ~BIV (that I am not a handless brain in a vat).  According to Closure, I would be warranted in believing ~BIV were I to deduce it from HAND.  But many think this procedure makes it much too easy to secure warrant for beliefs like ~BIV.  It is unclear what Burge’s position on this matter is, but it is something he may need to speak to if his view is to be tenable.  Note finally that Dretske is not faced with the same problem, because he rejects closure altogether (Dretske 2005).

A different sort of criticism has to do with whether there is any real conceptual difference between how Burge characterizes entitlement and how other epistemologists have characterized justification.  Albert Casullo (2009) argues that there is not.  As we have seen, the chief distinction between justification and entitlement, according to Burge, is:

(ACC) Justification is warrant that is conceptually accessible to the subject, and entitlement is warrant that need not be conceptually accessible to the subject.

It is not immediately clear, says Casullo, what is meant by the term ‘access’ or ‘accessible’, and he suggests three possible interpretations:

A1) Subject S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the epistemic ground that warrants S’s belief, that is, to the content of S’s warranting experience or belief.

A2) S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the adequacy of that ground, that is, to the justification for the belief that S’s ground is adequate to warrant the belief that p.

A3) S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the epistemic principle governing the ground of S’s belief that p, that is, to the conditions under which the ground warrants the belief that p and the conditions under which that warrant is undermined.

Bearing these separate interpretations in mind, Casullo provides textual evidence from Burge’s works that ACC should be read as claiming that justification satisfies A1 and A3 but not A2, whereas entitlement satisfies A1 but not A2 or A3.  But if this is the sense in which entitlements need not be accessible to the subject, this is just the view William Alston (1989b) had already proposed, which he calls an internalist externalism account of justification.  Thus, Casullo contends that any differences that exist between Burgean entitlement and Alstonian justification are terminological at best.

3. Wright on Entitlement

Crispin Wright’s approach to entitlement is motivated primarily by an attempt to ward off skeptical paradoxes.  In his (2004) paper, “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” he introduces the notion of a “cornerstone proposition” for a given region of thought, according to which “it would follow from a lack of warrant for it that one could not rationally claim warrant for any belief in that region” (p. 167-68).  The skeptical project involves two steps: (1) make a case that a certain proposition, which we characteristically accept, is a cornerstone for a much wider class of belief, and (2) argue that we lack warrant for that proposition.  Wright then identifies two general patterns of skeptical reasoning that deploy these two steps.  The first comes from the Cartesian skeptic, who argues that the proposition that we are not cognitively detached from reality (instances of which come in the more common skeptical-scenario varieties like ‘I am not dreaming’ or ‘I am not a brain in a vat’, and so forth) is a cornerstone proposition for our ordinary perceptual beliefs. As for this latter claim, the skeptic reasons that for any procedure one might utilize to try to determine, say, that one is not dreaming (for example, pinching oneself or trying to read the lines of a newspaper), one must already have an independent warrant for thinking that the procedure was executed properly, and moreover that one did not simply dream carrying it out.  But since utilizing any such procedure would require that one already have warrant for believing that one is not dreaming, there is no procedure one could effectively utilize to gain a warrant for this proposition.  Thus, our perceptual beliefs are unwarranted.

The second kind of skeptic, the Humean skeptic, reveals an implicit circularity embedded in our practices of inductive reasoning, where the observance of facts about a sample population causes us to make a claim about all of the population’s members (for example, the inference from ‘All observed Fs are G’ to ‘All Fs are G’).  The inductive inference relies on one’s being warranted in accepting a cornerstone proposition, which Wright calls the Uniformity Thesis: that nature abounds in regularities.  However, there is no way to gain warrant for the Uniformity Thesis, because this could only be accomplished by relying on induction itself (For an overview of the Humean Problem of Induction, see Stroud 1977).

According to Wright, the skeptical problem can be generalized in the following way:  Let P be a proposition representing some feature of observable reality (for example, ‘I have hands’), where the best and as the skeptic will argue only evidence in favor of P is rooted in perceptual experience.  To arrive at an anti-skeptical conclusion, one will typically deploy what Wright calls the I-II-III argument:

I: My current experience is in all respects as if P

II: P

III: There is a material world

The same argumentative structure can be utilized to refute skepticisms of a variety of subject matters.  For instance, where I stands for ‘X’s behavior and physical condition are in all respects as if X is in mental state M’, III stands for ‘There are minds besides my own’.  Or where I stands for ‘I seem to remember it being the case that P yesterday’, III stands for ‘The world did not come into being today replete with apparent traces of a more extended history’.  Although the I-II-III argument may appear to warrant the conclusion, Wright contests that it engenders a failure of warrant transmission, a notion he has developed (2003).  According to Wright, it is oftentimes the case that a body of evidence e is an information-dependent warrant for a proposition P, where e is an information-dependent warrant for P if whether e is correctly regarded as warranting P depends on what one has by way of collateral information C.  In cases where C is entailed by P, the warrant for P (which is sourced in e) would fail to transmit to C, were one to infer C from P.  Setting the skeptical problem aside for the moment, consider one of Wright’s own examples.  Suppose that e is your experience of seeing a ball kicked into a net, from which you infer P, the proposition that a goal has just been scored.  Let C be the proposition that a soccer game is in progress.  Now, although C is a logical consequence of P, were you to start with e and infer P and subsequently deduce C, this chain of reasoning could not provide you with any new warrant for believing C, because e’s warranting you in believing P presupposes that you already have a warrant for believing C.  That is, the warrant for P fails to transmit to C because P cannot be warranted (by e) unless C is something for which you already have warrant.

Returning to the anti-skeptical I-II-III argument, Wright claims that III (‘There is an external world’) is a cornerstone proposition for a range of observation-sourced propositions which may be expressed by II (for example, ‘I have hands’).  The point is that whether I successfully warrants II depends on one’s already having warrant for III.  But the warrant for III cannot come by way of the I-II-III argument.  One crucial difference between this situation and the soccer example is that whereas there are means by which you can secure independent warrant for the proposition that a soccer game is in progress (you can, for example, look up the start time of the game in the local newspaper), there appears to be no way to acquire warrant, independent of one’s experiential evidence, for the proposition that there is an external world.  The skeptic will therefore conclude that type-III propositions are unwarranted, and as they are cornerstones so are the associated type-II propositions.

Wright’s aim is not to defend but rather to alleviate skeptical worries.  His strategy is to argue that we do possess warrant for type-III cornerstone propositions, but that warrant does not come in the form of evidential justification, as the skeptic assumes it must.  He says:

Suppose there is a type of rational warrant which one does not have to do any specific evidential work to earn: better, a type of rational warrant whose possession does not require the existence of evidence in the broadest sense encompassing both a priori and empirical considerations for the truth of the warranted proposition.  Call it entitlement.  If I am entitled to accept P, then my doing so is beyond rational reproach even though I can point to no cognitive accomplishment in my life, whether empirical or a priori, inferential or non-inferential, whose upshot could reasonably be contended to be that I had come to know that P, or had succeeded in getting evidence justifying P (2004, p. 174-75).

According to Wright, we have entitlements to accept various cornerstone propositions, such as: ‘There is an external world’; ‘There are other minds’; ‘The world has an ancient past’; and ‘There are regularities present in nature’.  Entitlement is a kind of rational warrant that, unlike justification, does not depend on one’s having evidence one could point to that would speak to the truth of the proposition in question.  Whereas Detective Johnson’s believing that Smith is guilty of the murder is underwritten by her own cognitive accomplishment, by way of basing that belief on recognizable empirical evidence (see Section I above), and is therefore justified, entitlements are secured in a different way.  Similar to the views of both Dretske and Burge, having a Wrightean entitlement to accept a proposition does not require that one be able to think about what it is that gives one the entitlement (Wright 2007, Fn 6).  If Wright’s proposal is tenable, we find a way to circumvent the skeptical problem: we have unearned warrants (in the form of entitlements) to type-III propositions that are acquired independently of the I-II-III argument. Hence the skeptic has no grounds for accusing the anti-skeptic of viciously circular reasoning.

It is helpful to briefly compare and contrast Wrightean entitlement with the Burgean view discussed in the previous section.  One interesting similarity has to do with the connection between entitlement and justification as they relate to the structure of our warranted beliefs.  For both Burge and Wright, entitlements reside at the very foundation of the epistemic architecture of our beliefs.  All of our justified beliefs are ultimately based upon, or at least presuppose, entitlements.  For this reason, defenders of the entitlement-justification distinction are naturally affiliated with foundationalism, the view that there exist warranted beliefs which are not themselves warranted, or justified, by any further beliefs to which one could appeal.  In contrast, those who deny that such a distinction exists naturally steer toward coherentism or holism (see Sellars 1963, Davidson 1986, Cohen 2002).  However, Burge and Wright differ with respect to the propositions they claim reside at the foundation.  As we saw in the previous section, Burgean entitlements attach to beliefs concerning ordinary objects and properties in the world, which are non-inferentially sourced in perception, testimony, and memory.  The beliefs we rationally infer on the basis of them are justified.  In contrast, Wrightean entitlements attach to cornerstone propositions.  Although we do not typically infer further propositions on the basis of them, cornerstones provide the vital preconditions needed for our experiences or memory states to evidentially justify other (type-II) propositions.

Related to this last point, Burge can be seen as taking a liberal stance toward perceptual warrant, in that one’s experience alone provides one with immediate, non-inferential warrant for one’s perceptual beliefs.  In contrast, Wright adopts epistemic conservatism, according to which an experience provides warrant for a perceptual belief only on the condition that one has a prior warrant to accept the relevant type-III propositions (The terms ‘liberal’ and ‘conservative’ in epistemology are due to Pryor 2004.  See also Wright 2007).

One question that Wright raises is: What do our entitlements give us the right to do? Whereas for both Dretske and Burge our entitlements are rights to believe propositions, Wright has a different answer.  He suggests that part of what it is to hold a belief attitude toward a proposition is for that attitude to be controlled by reasoning and evidence.  Since entitlements are characteristically unaccompanied by evidence, he denies that they attach to belief.  Rather, where P is a proposition to which we have an entitlement, we are entitled to accept P.  Acceptance is a general kind of attitude of which belief is only one mode.  But, if belief is not the appropriate mode of acceptance for entitlement, what is it?  One suggestion Wright considers is ‘acting on the assumption that P’, but he immediately dismisses this because one can surely act on the assumption that a proposition is true while at the same time remaining agnostic or even skeptical of its truth.  Because entitlements provide essential preconditions for our having any warrant at all, whatever kind of attitude we have entitlements to must be something wherein one’s coming to doubt its truth would commit one to doubting the competence of the particular project in question.  Wright in the end settles on our having an entitlement to rationally trust P, where trust is a kind of acceptance weaker than belief (because it is not controlled by evidence), but stronger than acting on the assumption (because one is non-evidentially committed to the truth of P).

Wright’s position on what we have entitlements to raises a serious question regarding epistemic closure, according to which it is a necessary condition on being justified in believing P that one is also justified in believing those propositions one knows to be entailed by P.  Thus, given that my experience as of hands justifies me in believing HAND (the type-II proposition that I have hands), and I know that this entails ~BIV (the type-III proposition that I am not a handless brain in a vat) I must also be justified, according to closure, in believing ~BIV.  Yet, although Wright maintains that we have non-evidential entitlements to rationally trust type-III propositions, he denies that we are justified in believing them.  His proposal, therefore, appears to be at odds with closure.

In response to this alleged problem, Wright advises that we should qualify standard closure principles in such a way that we need not accept that evidentially justified belief is closed under known entailment.  Rather, if we let warrant range disjunctively over both entitlement and justification, we can allow that warranted acceptance (which ranges over belief; taking for granted; rational trust; acting on the assumption; and so forth) is so closed.  Thus, given that I am warranted in accepting HAND (in the form of a justified belief), and also that I know HAND entails ~BIV, I am warranted in accepting ~BIV (in the form of an entitled trust).  The upshot is that the warrant for a type-III proposition does not come by way inferring it from the related type-II proposition (for the type-II fails to transmit its warrant to the type-III), but this is nonetheless consistent with Wright’s qualified closure principle.

We will now consider two possible objections to Wright’s view.  As for the first objection, many will agree that:

(*) If it were antecedently reasonable to reject a type-III proposition, the warrant for the relevant type-II propositions would be removed.

The skeptic takes this thought one step further and concludes that:

(**) Type-II propositions can be warranted only if it is antecedently reasonable to accept type-III propositions.

Wright endorses (**), prompting him to characterize entitlements as positive warrants to trust.  However, Martin Davies (2004) has argued that by accepting (**), Wright concedes too much to the skeptic.  Instead, Davies claims that the inference from (*) to (**) is invalid: from the fact that my having reasonable doubt that ~BIV would defeat my warrant for believing HAND, it does not follow that I must have warrant for ~BIV in order to have warrant for HAND.  An alternative strategy would be to agree that doubt of ~BIV would defeat the warrant for HAND, while at the same time denying that one needs warranted trust in ~BIV in order for my experience as of hands to warrant HAND.  Davies thinks both of these claims can be met by attributing a different kind of entitlement to type-III propositions like ~BIV.  His suggestion is that we have entitlements not to doubt, not to call in question, or not to bother about, type-III propositions (2004, p. 226).  Thus, whereas a Wrightean entitlement is an entitlement to adopt a positive attitude of trust, Davies holds that it is an entitlement to adopt a negative attitude of not doubting; one would not need any positive warrant, earned or unearned, for type-III propositions to have warrant for type-II propositions.  One could take this approach one step even further and claim that type-II propositions do, contrary to what Wright says, transmit their warrants to type-III propositions.  In other words, the I-II-III argument is epistemically victorious: where I have no reason to doubt that I am a brain in a vat, my experience as of hands warrants me in believing HAND, which thereby warrants me in believing ~BIV when I draw the inference.  Whether or not this is a plausible anti-skeptical outcome is highly controversial (For a defense, see Pryor 2000 and 2004; for a rejection, see Cohen 2002).

A second objection to Wright’s view comes from Carrie Jenkins (2007), who has argued that even if we grant Wright that it is rational for us to accept, without evidence, cornerstone propositions, this cannot be an epistemic kind of rationality.  For any proposition P, one can be epistemically rational in accepting P only if one’s acceptance is brought about in a way that addresses the specific question of whether P is true.  Thus, in order for it to be epistemically rational of you to accept the proposition that China is the most populous country, your coming into this state of acceptance must be due, in part at least, to the fact that you take it to be true that China is the most populous country.  However, where P is a cornerstone proposition, like “My sensory apparatus is properly connected to the external world,” one’s acceptance of P is divorced from any considerations on the truth or falsity of P.  Instead, on the Wrightean view, accepting P is rational, roughly, because its acceptance is necessary in order to undertake the indispensible cognitive project of forming beliefs about the world based on perception.  This is a different kind of rationality, grounded not in terms of whether P is true, but in what fortunate consequences would result from one’s accepting P.  This is similar to the sense in which it would be rational (perhaps practically rational) for a runner in a race to believe she is not tired, since the act of forming this belief could actually prevent her from slowing down in the race.  It is doubtful that we could have epistemic entitlements to cornerstone propositions without it being epistemically rational to accept them.  This creates an obstacle for Wright given that his ultimate aim is to resolve the problem of skepticism in epistemology.

4. Peacocke on Entitlement

In his book, The Realm of Reason, Christopher Peacocke argues that we have entitlements to our perceptual beliefs, a priori beliefs, beliefs based on inductive inference, beliefs about our own actions, and moral beliefs.  Our entitlements to the latter four classes of belief are explained as extensions and consequences of the explanatory structure of our entitlement to perceptual beliefs.  Accordingly, this section will focus on Peacocke’s account of perceptual entitlement.

Peacocke does not distinguish entitlement from justification in the way that Dretske, Burge, and Wright do.  His notion of ‘entitlement’ is intended to range over both inferential and non-inferential transitions between mental states.  For Peacocke, entitlement plays a more central role in epistemology, for he claims that a judgment or belief is knowledge only if it is reached by a transition to which the subject is entitled.  Indeed, at times he seems to use the terms ‘entitlement’ and ‘justification’ interchangeably.  So, whereas for Dretske, Burge, and Wright, entitlements and justifications are distinct epistemic goods that make separable contributions to knowledge, Peacocke seems only to be operating with one epistemic concept, which he frequently refers to as entitlement.  As for another difference, we saw that entitlements for Burge and Dretske attach to beliefs, while Wrightean entitlements attach to attitudes of rational trust.  For Peacocke, we have entitlements not only to beliefs or judgments, but also to the transitions that link beliefs to antecedent mental states.  So, part of what it takes to have a perceptual entitlement to the belief, for example, that there is something round ahead, is that one is also entitled to the transition that brings one from having an experience of something round to the formation of that belief.  Nonetheless, a crucial element of Peacockean entitlement common to those of the other three authors discussed in this article is his position that “[a] thinker may be entitled to make a judgment without having the capacity to think about the states which entitle him to make the judgment” (2004, p. 7).

In order to understand Peacocke’s account of perceptual entitlement, it is important first to appreciate two conditions he thinks any transition must meet in order to award a subject an entitlement.  The first condition is conveyed in what he calls the Special Truth Conduciveness Thesis:

A fundamental and irreducible part of what makes a transition one to which one is entitled is that the transition tends to lead to true judgments…in a distinctive way characteristic of rational transitions (2004, p. 11).

Here we see that Peacocke agrees with Burge that entitlement (or for Burge, all forms of warrant) must be a good route to truth.  A necessary condition on entitlement for both Peacocke and Burge is that whichever state produces the entitled judgment or belief is a reliable indicator of the way things are in the world.  Note that this condition is not necessary for Dretskean entitlement, for it could be that a fully responsible agent cannot avoid believing there to be a bright screen ahead of her while her perceptual faculties are in fact highly unreliable (as would be the case were the agent a brain in a vat).  But the principle also implies that not just any transition leading to true judgments is sufficient for an entitlement.  In addition, the transition must be one that is characteristic of rational transitions.  Some processes encompass transitions between states which are highly reliable, yet these transitions are not what we would consider rational.  For example, suppose that due to some psychological defect, whenever I see a cardinal fly above me, this visual experience causes me to judge that the St. Louis Cardinals baseball team won today.  By sheer coincidence the only time that I see cardinals flying are on days when the Cardinals happen to win.  This transition between the state of seeing a cardinal and the state of judging that the Cardinals won tends to lead to true judgments, yet it is clear that it is quite irrational of me to form these judgments (for a similar sort of example, see Bonjour 1985).  What, then, is it that distinguishes specifically rational transitions?  The answer is given by what Peacocke calls the Rationalist Dependence Thesis, which is the second condition necessary for securing an entitlement:

The rational truth-conduciveness of any given transition to which a thinker is entitled is to be philosophically explained in terms of the nature of the intentional contents and states involved in the transition (2004, p. 52).

According to this second condition, whether or not a transition is rational depends on the specific explanation for why that transition is reliable.  The feature that is characteristic of rational transitions, according to Peacocke, is that they are reliable because of the very nature of the mental states involved, the contents that they have and how it is that those states are capable of representing the world in a certain way.  If the reliability of some transition is explained by something other than the very identity of the states involved in the transition and the individuation of their contents (such as if it were some mere accident that a type of experience reliably led to true judgments, as in the cardinal example above), then that transition, though reliable, would not be rational and would therefore fail to yield any entitlement.

With the two above theses introduced, we see that transitions between states yield entitlements only if they are conducive to truth, and furthermore their being reliable can be philosophically explained in terms of the states involved in the transition.  With regard to perceptual entitlement in particular, the kinds of experiences Peacocke thinks are relevant to meeting this criterion are those which have instance-individuated contents, such as the experience expressed by “That thing looks round.”  What makes this experience’s content instance-individuated is that when one’s perceptual faculties are properly functioning, and the environment is normal, one’s having this experience with this content is “caused by the holding of the condition which is in fact the correctness condition for that content” (2004, p. 67).  In simpler terms, the correct perceptual representation of an object as round does not causally depend on any other mental states or relations aside from the subject’s being properly connected to that round object in the world.  In contrast, an experience expressed by “There looks to be a soldier over there” does not have instance-individuated content because one’s correctly representing a soldier causally depends not only on there being a soldier where one represents it as being, but also on the background empirical knowledge one needs to have of what it is to be a soldier, how soldiers typically dress, and so on.

A Peacockean perceptual entitlement can thus be described as follows: “A subject enjoying an experience with a content which is instance-individuated is entitled to judge that content (that is, accept that experience at face value), in the absence of reasons for doubting that she is perceiving properly.”  Note that in the presence of reasons for doubt, one’s entitlement is removed.  Thus, Peacockean entitlement, like that of Dretske, Burge and Wright, has defeasibility conditions built into it.

The central task for Peacocke is to offer a philosophical explanation of the entitlement relation between experiences with instance-individuated contents and their corresponding perceptual judgments, which will consist of an a priori argument that demonstrates that the transitions between these states are conducive to truth.  His strategy is to argue that the existence of perceptual experiences with instance-individuated contents is best explained by the fact that those experiences are produced by a device that evolved by natural selection to represent the world to the subject, and that the perceptual experiences produced in the subject are predominantly correct.  Moreover, judgments based on these experiences are likely to be true.  To defend this claim, he relies on what he calls the Complexity Reduction Principle:

Other things equal, good explanations of complex phenomena explain the more complex in terms of the less complex; they reduce complexity (2004, p. 83).

This principle describes a key feature of what makes an explanation a good one.  When we are presented with some complex phenomenon, the explanation we should endorse, out of all the alternatives, is the one that explains the phenomenon in the least complex terms.  By accepting this principle, we are accepting that “it is…more rational to hold, other things equal, that [things] have come about in an easy, rather than in a highly improbable, way” (2004, p. 83).  Consider one of Peacocke’s own cases stemming from natural science.  Every snowflake contains six identical patterns separated by sixty-degree segments around its center.  This is an example of a complex phenomenon, one that immediately strikes us as highly improbable.  The best explanation for why snowflakes exhibit this pattern will inform us, by reducing complexity, that the alleged improbability is merely apparent: oxygen molecules in frozen water are roughly spherical and they are arranged on a plane.  The frozen crystals grow in a way that minimizes energy, and the most energy-efficient way of packing spheres on a plane results in a hexagonal arrangement (2004, p. 75-6).  One possible alternative explanation could be that snowflakes are built on skeletons that exhibit six-fold symmetry.  However, the latter explanation is less preferable to the former, because the latter is no less complex than the phenomenon itself: we would simply shift the question to why it is that the skeleton, rather than the snowflake, exhibits this pattern.

Like the example of snowflakes, our having experiences with instance-individuated contents is a highly complex phenomenon.  That the perceptual system produces states that are in large part correct, and was naturally selected to accurately represent the world to the subject, explains the phenomenon with the least amount of complexity.  A subject’s being in a state of perceptually representing an object o as having property F would not appear improbable if an Fo in the environment caused the state, and the subject had a properly functioning system that had adapted over the millennia, by way of interacting with objects like o’s and properties like F-ness, to accurately represent features in the environment.  It is a virtue of this explanation that it does not posit any further representational states that are equally as complex as the perceptual states under discussion and are, in turn, in need of explanation.

Peacocke argues further that the proposed explanation succeeds at reducing complexity better than alternative skeptical hypotheses.  There are two general types of such hypotheses he considers.  The first is one in which the subject’s illusory perceptual states are produced by some intentional agent, such as the Cartesian Demon.  In this scenario, it is typically postulated that the deceiver either has experiences herself, in which case our perceptual states get explained in terms of another’s perceptual states, or she lacks experiences but has other intentional states with comparable complexity.  Either way, the hypothesis purporting to explain the phenomenon under discussion would stand in need of further explanation.  In the second type of skeptical hypothesis, our illusory experiences are not intentionally produced, but are instead generated randomly or coincidentally, such as your being a member of a randomly generated universe containing nothing but a population of deluded brains in vats (see Putnam 2000).  However, this sort of hypothesis involves highly complex initial conditions, such as the original set up describing how the vats are capable of producing conscious, intentional states.  Thus, it fails to reduce the complexity of the phenomenon of our having perceptual states.

To summarize, Peacocke justifies the claim that we are entitled to form judgments about the world on the basis of our experiences with instance-individuated contents, on the grounds that our having these experiences with these contents is best explained by the evolution of the perceptual system and its selection for accurate representation of the environment.  We will consider a number of criticisms of Peacocke’s view.  First, in attempting to give a philosophical explanation of the truth-conduciveness of the transition between experience and judgment, we have seen that Peacocke invokes the theory of natural selection.  But because his aim is to prove that our experiences are by and large correct, his argument cannot depend on any empirically justified premises.  However, natural selection is an empirical scientific theory that is justified in part by our experiences, so we should not expect that it could be used to answer the skeptic.  Peacocke insists though that his argument “does not have the truth of the whole empirical biological theory of evolution by natural selection as one of its premises” (2004, p. 98).  But if Peacocke’s argument is sound, and he is right that each premise is justified a priori, the implication, as Ralph Wedgwood (2007) notes, is that no scientific investigation was required whatsoever for Darwin to justify the claim that he evolved through natural selection—all he needed to do to learn that the theory of evolution is true was to engage in philosophical contemplation and to reflect on his own experiences.  But the suggestion that a theory such as this one could be justified a priori seems highly implausible.

Another challenge to Peacocke’s project is to question whether the natural selection-based explanation reduces complexity any more than the alternative explanations.  The skeptic will argue that the existence of living creatures and the evolution of psychological systems within some of its members is itself a complex phenomenon standing in need of further explanation.  In addition, the skeptic could reject the Complexity Reduction Principle altogether: that an explanation is simpler, or succeeds at reducing complexity, does not speak to whether it is the one we ought to accept (see Lycan 1988; for Peacocke’s response see 2004, p. 94-7).

Finally, even if we grant that the Complexity Reduction Principle is true and that the natural selection-based explanation demonstrates that judgments sourced in perception tend toward truth, one might still question whether it adequately demonstrates how transitions between experience and judgment are characteristically rational (that is, whether it appropriately conforms to the Rationalist Dependence Thesis).  In order for us to rationally rely on our (reliably accurate) experiences, is it the case that we must also know, or justifiably believe, that the natural selection-based explanation most reduces complexity?  Peacocke thinks the answer must be negative; otherwise, anyone unaware of the Complexity Reduction Principle (which, presumably, is most people) would lack entitlements to their perceptual beliefs, and moreover would lack perceptual knowledge.  Instead, he holds that it is sufficient that the transition from experience to judgment be rational from the subject’s own point of view, that is, that the subject appreciates that her experiential grounds for the transition to the judgment that P suffice for the truth of P (2004, p. 176).  However, Miguel Fernández (2006) notes a problem with this move.  When one comes to “appreciate one’s grounds,” this involves, at least on a natural interpretation of appreciate, that one forms an additional judgment, specifically, a second-order judgment of the form:

SOJ: This experience representing P provides adequate grounds for the truth of P.

Of course, if one’s judgment that SOJ is partially underwriting one’s entitlement to judge that P, then it must be that the transition leading one to judge SOJ is also rational from the subject’s own point of view.  To meet this requirement, however, one would need to then hold a third-order judgment of the form:

TOJ: My grounds for judging SOJ are adequate for the truth of SOJ.

The problem is that because TOJ would also need to be rational from the subject’s own point of view, we are forced into an implausible infinite regress of increasingly higher-order judgments, each used to rationalize the transition attached to the lower-ordered judgment.  Demanding that one form all of these judgments would seem to hyper-intellectualize perceptual entitlement, and it would go against Peacocke’s position, mentioned at the beginning of the section, that a subject can be entitled to a judgment without having the capacity to think about the states that entitle that judgment.  In order to avoid this undesirable outcome, Peacocke could attempt to elucidate the notion of “appreciating one’s grounds” in a way that does not suggest forming a higher-order judgment.  Or, if that option is not feasible, he could, in following Dretske and Burge, relinquish the requirement altogether that a transition be rational from the subject’s own point of view.

5. Conclusion

This article has explored the views of epistemic entitlement as presented by four prominent philosophers: Dretske, Burge, Wright, and Peacocke.  As we have seen, there are important similarities and differences among these views.  Burge and Peacocke both hold that reliability is necessary for enjoying perceptual entitlements, but also that the reliability must be explained in terms of the nature and individuation of the perceptual states involved.  For both Wright and Peacocke, their accounts of entitlement purport to provide anti-skeptical outcomes about knowledge, while Dretskean and Burgean entitlement is explained independently of the skeptical problem.  According to Dretske and Burge we have entitlements to hold various non-inferential beliefs.  In contrast, Wright holds that what we are entitled to do is to rationally trust certain corner stone propositions, like that there is an external world and there is a past.  Peacocke differs from the other three authors in that he claims that all rational judgments, as well as the transitions leading to those judgments, are underwritten by entitlements.  Despite these differences, one element common to each of the views we have discussed is the idea that entitlements are defeasible epistemic rights that are not grounded in conceptually accessible reasons or evidence.  One can have an entitlement even if one is unable to think about the states that provide the entitlement.  In this regard, distinguishing entitlement from justification has the advantage of attributing a kind of positive epistemic status to individuals who lack the critical reasoning skills needed to justify their own beliefs.  The inclusion of the concept of entitlement therefore steers away from hyper-intellectualizing the warrant for our basic beliefs about the world.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston W. (1989). Epistemic Justification: Essays in the Theory of Knowledge. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • A collection of essays on justification and knowledge written by William Alston.
  • Alston, W. (1989a). “The Deontological Conception of Epistemic Justification.” in Alston (1989).
    • Provides a series of arguments against deontological views of justification which center around the concepts of duty, praiseworthy, requirement, blameless by relying heavily on the impossibility of our having control over our beliefs.
  • Alston, W. (1989b). “An Internalist Externalism.” in Alston (1989).
    • Attempts to reconcile the internalism/externalism debate in epistemology by advancing a view of justification that incorporates both internalist and externalist elements.
  • Bach, K. (1985). “A Rationale for Reliabilism.” The Monist, 68: 246-265.
    • Defends reliabilism against its more well-known objections by drawing a distinction between a justified belief and a subject’s being justified in holding a belief.
  • Bonjour, L. (1985). The Structure of Empirical Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Develops an anti-foundationalist, coherentist theory of knowledge.
  • Burge, T. (1993). “Content Preservation.” The Philosophical Review, 102 (4): 457-488.
    • Argues that we have non-inferential entitlements to rely on the testimony of others.
  • Burge T. (1996). “Our Entitlement to Self-knowledge.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 96 (1): 91-116.
    • Argues that we have entitlements to beliefs about our own mental states.
  • Burge, T. (2003). “Perceptual Entitlement.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 67 (3): 503-548.
    • Provides a teleological account of perceptual entitlements as grounded in the anti-individualistic nature of perception.
  • Burge, T. (2005). “Disjunctivism and Perceptual Psychology.” Philosophical Topics, 33 (1): 1-78.
    • Argues against the view of perception called Disjunctivism on the grounds that it conflicts with established psychological theories of vision.
  • Burge T. (2007). Foundations of Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A collection of Burge’s papers in philosophy of mind on anti-individualism.
  • Burge, T. (2007a). “Cartesian Error and the Objectivity of Perception.” in Burge (2007).
    • Defends the claim that our perceptual states are anti-individualistically individuated and introduces his famous Crack-Shadow thought experiment.
  • Casullo, A. (2009). “What is Entitlement?” Acta Analytica, 22: 267-279.
    • Provides a detailed overview and critique of Burge’s proposed distinction between entitlement and justification.
  • Chisholm, R. (1977). Theory of Knowledge. (2nd edition) Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
    • Defends a deontological conception of knowledge and justification.
  • Cohen, S. (2002). “Basic Knowledge and the Problem of Easy Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 65 (2): 309-329.
    • Denies the existence of basic knowledge (knowledge obtained from a source prior to one’s knowing that that source is reliable) through considerations involving closure and bootstrapping.
  • Comesaña, J. (2002). “The Diagonal and the Demon.” Philosophical Studies, 110: 249-266.
    • Advances a new version of reliabilism called Indexical Reliabilism, then argues it circumvents the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Conee, E and Feldman, R. (1985). “Evidentialism.” Philosophical Studies, 48: 15-34.
    • Defends evidentialism in epistemology, the view that the justification of one’s belief is determined by the strength of one’s evidence for that belief.
  • Davidson, D. (1986). “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge.” in E. Lepore (ed.) Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. Blackwell Publishing.
    • Argues for coherentism about truth and knowledge.
  • Davies, M. (2004). “Epistemic Entitlement, Warrant Transmission and Easy Knowledge.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Issue 78 (1): 213-245.
    • Critically discusses Crispin Wright’s views on entitlement, and advances the idea of a negative entitlement not to doubt cornerstone propositions.
  • Dretske, F. (2000). “Entitlement: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60 (3): 591-606.
    • Argues for the existence of epistemic entitlements as grounded in the immediacy and irresistibility of various beliefs and motivated by the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Dretske, F. (2005). “The Case Against Closure.” in M. Steup and E. Sosa (eds.) Contemporary Debates in Epistemology. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
    • Rejects closure by first assuming skepticism is false, and secondly by arguing for the disjunction that either closure is false or skepticism is true.
  • Evans, G. (1982). The Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Proposes a theory of demonstrative thought in this seminal work, and introduces the notion of nonconceptual content.
  • Fernandez. M. (2006). “Troubles with Peacocke’s Rationalism.” Critica, 38 (112): 81-103.
    • Critically discusses Christopher Peacocke’s (2004) book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Ginet, C. (1975). Knowledge, Perception, and Memory. Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
    • Argues for a strong version of internalism, according to which all of the facts that make a subject’s beliefs justified are directly recognizable by the subject upon reflection.
  • Goldman, A. (1986). Epistemology and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Makes a case for epistemology to draw upon the findings in cognitive science.
  • Goldman. A. (1988). “Strong and Weak Justification.” Philosophical Perspectives, 2: 51-69.
    • Advances a modified version of reliabilism that places a distinction between the concepts of strong justification and weak justification.
  • Heck, R. (2007). "Are There Different Kinds of Content?" in B. McLaughlin and J. Cohen (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Mind. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
    • Argues for the existence of nonconceptual content based on the implausibility of perceptual content, satisfying Gareth Evans’ generality constraint on thought.
  • Henderson, D. and Horgan, T. (2007). “Some Ins and Outs of Transglobal Reliabilism.” in S. Goldberg (ed.), Internalism and Externalism in Semantics and Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Advances a new version of reliabilism called transglobal reliabilism, according to which the reliability of a belief process is evaluated relative to the set of experientially possible global environments.
  • Janvid, M. (2009). “The Value of Lesser Goods: The Epistemic Value of Entitlement.”  Acta Analytica, 24: 263-274.
    • Compares the epistemic value of entitlement with that of justification, and criticizes both Burgean and Dretskean entitlement.
  • Jenkins, C. (2007). “Entitlement and Rationality.” Synthese, 157: 25-45.
    • Challenges Crispin Wright’s entitlement of cognitive project, arguing that such entitlement to accept a proposition cannot be construed as epistemically rational.
  • Lehrer, K and Cohen, S. (1983). “Justification, Truth, and Coherence.” Synthese, 55: 191-207.
    • Challenges the time-honored connection between justification and truth by introducing what is nowadays commonly referred to as the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Lycan, W. (1988). Judgement and Justification. Cambridge, MA: Cambridge University Press.
    • Defends a version of epistemological explanationism as a theory of justification.
  • Majors, B. (2005). “The New Rationalism.” Philosophical Papers, 34 (2): 289-305.
    • A critical discussion of Christopher Peacocke’s (2004) book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Majors, B and Sawyer, S. (2005). “The Epistemological Argument for Content Externalism.” Philosophical Perspectives, 19: 257-280.
    • Argues that that the only epistemological view that can adequately account for the constitutive relation between justification and truth is one that involves a commitment to content externalism.
  • Millikan, R. (1984). Language, Thought and Other Biological Categories. Cambridge, MA: MIT press.
    • Develops a naturalistic account of language and thought, wherein the meaning associated with sentences and the intentionality associated with thoughts are to be explicated in terms of how sentences and thoughts properly function.
  • Peacocke, C. (1992). A Study of Concepts. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Proposes a theory of concepts in which concepts are individuated by their possession conditions, and also introduces the notions of ‘scenario content’ and ‘protoproposition’ as they apply to perceptual content.
  • Peacocke, C. (2001). "Does Perception have a Nonconceptual Content?" Journal of Philosophy, 98: 609-615.
    • Defends the claim that perception has nonconceptual content, and wards off criticisms from John McDowell and Bill Brewer.
  • Peacocke, C. (2004). The Realm of Reason. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Develops a rationalist picture of epistemic entitlement according to which we have entitlements to our perceptual beliefs, a priori beliefs, beliefs based on inductive inference, beliefs about our own actions, and moral beliefs.
  • Pryor, J. (2000). "The Skeptic and the Dogmatist." Nous, 34: 517-49.
    • Defends dogmatism, a modest foundationalist view according to which an experience as of p’s being the case provides one with a prima facie justification to believe that p, without requiring that one have independent reason to believe one is not in a skeptical scenario.
  • Pryor, J. (2001). “Recent Highlights of Epistemology.” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 52: 95-124.
    • Canvases a host of popular topics in contemporary epistemology, including contextualism, modest foundationalism, the internalism/externalism debate, and the ethics of belief.
  • Pryor, J. (2004). “What’s wrong with Moore’s Argument?” Philosophical Issues, 14: 349-378.
    • Defends the Moorean response to skepticism.
  • Putnam, H. (2000). “Brains in a Vat.” in S. Bernecker and F. Dretske (eds.), Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology. Oxford University Press.
    • Appeals to externalist accounts of meaning to argue that the statement, “I am a brain in a vat,” is self-defeating, and so cannot be true.
  • Sellars, W. (1963). Science, Perception and Reality. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Famously argues against the “Myth of the Given” and develops a broadly coherentist epistemology.
  • Stroud, B. (1977). Hume. New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Offers a detailed overview of Hume’s philosophy, including the Problem of Induction.
  • Wedgwood, R. (2007). “Christopher Peacocke’s The Realm of Reason.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 74 (3): 776-791.
    • Critically discusses Christopher Peacocke’s book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Williams, M. (2000). “Dretske on Epistemic Entitlement.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60 (3): 607-612.
    • Critically discusses Fred Dretske’s (2000) paper, “Entitlement: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?”
  • Wright, C. (2003). “Some Reflections on the Acquisition of Warrant by Inference” in S. Nuccetelli (ed.), New Essays on Semantic Externalism, Skepticism and Self-Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Explains the difference between a cogent argument and an argument in which the premises fails to transmit their warrants to the conclusion.
  • Wright, C. (2004). “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 78 (1):167–212.
    • Develops the notion of unearned entitlements for cornerstone propositions, and explores the prospects and limitations on strategic entitlement, entitlement of cognitive project, entitlement of rational deliberation, and entitlement of substance.
  • Wright, C. (2007). “The Perils of Dogmatism.” in S. Nuccetelli and G. Seay (eds.), Themes from G. E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Presents a series of problems for dogmatist accounts of justification.

 

Author Information

Jon Altschul
Email: jlaltsch@loyno.edu
Loyola University-New Orleans
U. S. A.

Transmission and Transmission Failure in Epistemology

An argument transmits justification to its conclusion just in case, roughly, the conclusion is justified in virtue of the premises’ being justified.  An argument fails to transmit justification just in case, roughly, the conclusion is not justified in virtue of the premises’ being justified.  An argument might fail to transmit justification for a variety of uncontroversial reasons, such as the premise’s being unjustified; the premises’ failing to support the conclusion; or the argument’s exhibiting premise circularity.  There are transmission issues concerning testimony, but this article focuses on when arguments (fail to) transmit justification or knowledge or some other epistemic status.

Transmission failure is an interesting issue because it is difficult to identify what, if anything, prevents competent deductions from justifying their conclusions.  One makes a competent deduction when she accepts a deductive argument in certain circumstances.  These deductions seem to be the paradigmatic form of reasoning in that they apparently must transmit justification to their conclusions.  At the same time, though, certain competent deductions seem bad.  Consider Moore’s Proof:  I have a hand therefore there is at least one material thing.  Some philosophers hold that Moore’s Proof cannot transmit justification to its conclusion under any circumstances, and so, despite appearances, some competent deductions are instances of transmission failure.  Identifying what, if anything, prevents such arguments from justifying their conclusions is a tricky, controversial affair.

Transmission principles are intimately connected with closure principles.  An epistemic closure principle might say that, if one knows P and deduces Q from P, then one knows that Q.  Closure principles are silent as to what makes Q known, but the corresponding transmission principles are not.  A transmission principle might say that, if one knows P and deduces Q from P, then one knows Q in virtue of knowing P.

Those sympathetic to Moore’s Proof sometimes say that the “proof” can justify its conclusion even though it lacks the power to resolve doubt.  An argument can resolve doubt about its conclusion when the argument can justify its conclusion even for a subject who antecedently disbelieves or withholds judgment about the argument’s conclusion.

Table of Contents

  1. Transmission: The General Concept
  2. Transmission in Epistemology
  3. Transmission Failure
    1. Uncontroversial Causes
    2. Why Transmission Failure is an Interesting Issue
    3. Two More Puzzling Cases
  4. Transmission (Failure) vs. Closure (Failure)
    1. The Basic Difference
    2. The (Misplaced?) Focus on Closure
    3. Why Transmission is an Interesting Issue, Revisited
  5. Transmission Failure: Two Common Assumptions
    1. Transmission of Warrant vs. Transmission of Justification
    2. Transmission vs. Resolving Doubt
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Transmission: The General Concept

The term ‘transmission’ is not unique to philosophical discourse: religious and cultural traditions often are transmitted from one generation to the next; diseases from one person to another; and information of various kinds from one computer to another (often via the internet).  A car’s transmission gets its name from its intended purpose, namely to transmit the energy from the engine to its wheels (to put it crudely).  The use of ‘transmission’ in epistemological contexts is deeply connected to its use in everyday contexts.  Tucker (2010, section 1) holds that one can clarify the epistemological concept of transmission by considering an everyday instance of transmission.

Under what conditions does Alvin’s computer A transmit information to another computer B?  Tucker suggests it will do so just in case (i) A had the information and (ii) B has the information in virtue of A’s having it.  The first condition is very intuitive.  If A does not have the information but B acquires it anyway, it may be true that something transmitted the information to B.  Yet, unless A has the information, it won’t be true that A transmitted the information to B.  The second condition is intuitive but vague.  If B has the information in virtue of A’s having it, then A causes B to have it.  Yet mere causation is not enough to satisfy this in virtue of relation.  If A sends the information to B over an Ethernet or USB cable, we do seem to have the requisite sort of causal relation, and, in these cases, A seems to transmit the information to B.

Suppose A just finished downloading the information, which makes Alvin so excited that he does a wild victory dance.  During this dance he accidently hits B’s keyboard, which causes B to download the information from the internet (and not Alvin’s computer).  In such a case, A’s having the information causes B to have it, but the information was not transmitted from A to B.  Although transmission requires that a causal relation hold, not just any causal relation will do.  This article will follow Tucker in using ‘in virtue of’ as a placeholder for whatever causal relation is required for transmission.

Generalizing from this example, Tucker concludes that transmission is a three-place relation between: (i) the property P that is transmitted; (ii) the thing a from which the property is transmitted; and (iii) the thing b to which the property is transmitted.  A property P is transmitted from a to b just in case b has P in virtue of a’s having P.  In the above example, the property P is having the information; a is A, Alvin’s computer; and b is B, some other computer.  So A transmits the information to B just in case B has the information in virtue of A’s having it.

The preceding discussion clarifies statements of the form ‘a transmits P to b’, but there is another, more informative kind of transmission ascription, which we can symbolize as ‘R transmits P from a to b’.  Contrast ‘A transmitted the information to B’ with the equally natural expression ‘The USB cable transmitted the information from A to B’.  Whereas the former notes only that the information was transmitted from A to B, the latter additionally notes how it was transmitted.  Under what conditions does the USB cable (more precisely: being connected by the USB cable) transmit the information from A to B?  I suggest that it will do so just in case (i) A had the information and (ii) B has the information in virtue of both A’s having it and A’s being connected by a USB cable to B.

2. Transmission in Epistemology

When epistemologists consider transmission or transmission failure, they generally ask such questions as:

  • Under what conditions does entailment transmit justification?
  • Under what conditions do competent deductions transmit rational belief?
  • Does testimony transmit knowledge?

Epistemologists, then, are concerned with whether some relation (for example, entailment, competent deduction, testimony) transmits some epistemic property (for example, being rational, being justified, being known, or being defeated).  They tend to have in mind, therefore, the more informative sort of transmission ascription (see section 1).  That is, they are concerned not just with whether a belief is, say, known in virtue of another belief’s being known; they are also concerned with whether, say, entailment is the particular relation that allows the first belief to be known in virtue of the second.

This article will focus exclusively on when arguments or inferences (fail to) transmit some epistemic value property, such as being justified or being known.  The reason is that, when philosophers talk about transmission failure as an independent issue, they tend to have in mind the conditions under which an argument or inference fails to transmit.  The conditions under which testimony (fails to) transmit, say, knowledge is an interesting and important issue.  Yet these issues are often pursued in conjunction with or subsumed under other important issues relating to testimony, such as the conditions under which testimony preserves knowledge.  (For a brief intro to some of the relevant transmission issues pertaining to testimony, see Lackey 2008, section 3.)  In any case, this article will focus on the transmission issues pertaining to arguments or inferences, rather than the issues pertaining to testimony or other epistemically interesting relations.

An argument is a set of propositions such that one proposition, the conclusion, is supported by or is taken to be supported by the other propositions in that set, the premises.  An argument, as such, is merely a set of propositions that bear a special relation with one another.  Arguments can play a role in transmitting justification or knowledge when a subject believes the premises or when a subject infers the conclusion from the premises.  If epistemic transmission is analogous to the above computer transmission case (sec. 1), then an argument transmits justification to its conclusion when (i) the premises have some epistemically valuable status (for example, being justified, being known) and (ii) the conclusion has that same status in virtue of the premises’ having it.  (Here and elsewhere, for the sake of simplicity, I ignore the additional complexity of the more informative transmission ascriptions.)  The following case seems to satisfy (i) and (ii), and so it seems to transmit justification from the premises to the conclusion.

The Counting Case: Consider this argument: (a) that there are exactly 25 people in the room; and (b) that if there are exactly 25 people in the room, then there are fewer than 100 people in the room; therefore (c) there are fewer than 100 people in the room.  Suppose that Counter justifiably believes (a) on the basis of perception; that he justifiably believes (b) a priori; and that he believes (c) on the basis of (a) and (b).

The counting case seems to be a paradigmatic case of successful transmission.  Counter’s belief in the premises, namely (a) and (b), are justified (so (i) is satisfied), and the conclusion, namely (c), seems to be justified in virtue the premises’ being justified (so (ii) is satisfied).  Notice, however, that whether an argument transmits is relative to a subject.  The argument in the Counting Case transmits for Counter but not for someone who lacks justification for the premises.

The Counting Case also illustrates the deep connection between the transmission of justification and inferential justification.  When philosophers address inferential justification, they are concerned with the conditions under which the premises of an argument justify the argument’s conclusion. If one belief (belief in the premise) justifies another belief (belief in the conclusion), belief in the conclusion is inferentially justified.  Notice that the conclusion in the counting case is inferentially justified because it is justified by its premises.  The Counting Case, therefore, illustrates both inferential justification and the successful transmission of justification.  This is no accident.  It is almost universally assumed that inferential justification works by transmission; it is assumed that when the conclusion is justified by the premises, the premises transmit their justification to their conclusions.  Hence, the transmission of justification across an argument is deeply connected to inferential justification.

It should be noted that sometimes, when philosophers talk about transmission, they use the term “transfer” rather than “transmission” (for example, Davies 1998).  The latter terminology seems preferable, as Davies now admits (2000: 393, nt. 17).  “Transfer” often connotes that, when P is transferred from a to b, a no longer has P.  If I transfer water from one cup to another, the transferred water is no longer in the first cup.  “Transmission” lacks that connotation: when a computer transmits some information to another computer, the first computer typically retains the transmitted information.

3. Transmission Failure

a. Uncontroversial Causes

An argument is an instance of transmission failure just in case it does not transmit (some degree of) justification (or whatever epistemic status is at issue) from the premises to the conclusion.  Arguments can fail to transmit justification to their conclusions for a number of reasons.  Here are a few relatively uncontroversial causes of transmission failure:

  • Unjustified Premises: If an argument’s premises are all unjustified, then the argument is a trivial case of transmission failure; for the premises had no justification to transmit to its conclusion in the first place.  It does not follow, though, that all of an inference’s premises must be justified for it to transmit justification to its conclusion.  Consider an inductive inference with 100 premises of the form ‘on this occasion the unsuspended pencil fell to the ground’.  If 99 of the 100 premises are justified, it seems that those 100 premises can transmit justification to the belief that the next unsuspended pencil will also fall, despite that one of the premises fails to be justified.  (See the article “Deductive and Inductive Arguments” for a brief explanation of the differences between deductive and inductive arguments.)
  • Premise Circularity:  An argument is premise circular just in case its ultimate conclusion also appears as a premise.  For instance, consider P therefore Q therefore P.  The ultimate conclusion, P, is used as the sole premise for the intermediate conclusion, Q.  Even given that P transmits justification to Q, it seems clear that the justification P has in virtue of Q cannot be transmitted back to Q.  (The term ‘premise circular’ will be used loosely, such that both the extended argument P therefore Q therefore P and the second stage of the argument, Q therefore P, are premise circular.)
  • The Premises Fail to Evidentially Support Their Conclusion: Consider the argument: ‘I have a hand; therefore, the Stay Puft Marshmallow Man is eating a Ghostbuster’.  The premise is justified; however, it fails to transmit its justification to the conclusion because having a hand is not evidence that the Marshmallow Man is doing anything, much less eating a Ghostbuster.
  • The Premises Provide Less Than Maximal Evidential Support: An argument that provides maximal evidential support, such as one in the form of modus ponens, is capable of transmitting all of its premises’ justification to the conclusion.  Arguments that provide some less-than-maximal degree of support, such as a good inductive argument, fail to transmit all of the premises’ justification to the conclusion.  Good inductive arguments with justified premises both partially transmit and partially fail to transmit justification from the premises to the conclusion.  Other things being equal, the stronger the support, the more justification the argument transmits from the premises to the conclusion.
  • Defeaters: A good argument might fail to transmit justification because one has a relevant defeater (for example, relevant counterevidence).  Suppose I believe some mathematical theorem T on what is in fact exemplary deductive reasoning.  If I know that my coffee has been spiked with a drug known to cause egregious errors in reasoning, then my exemplary deductive reasoning is an instance of at least partial transmission failure.

b. Why Transmission Failure is an Interesting Issue

It is relatively uninteresting if an argument fails to transmit for any of the above reasons.  But suppose an argument has well-justified premises; the premises provide deductive (so maximal) support for their conclusion; the subject knows that the premises provide deductive support for their conclusions; there are no relevant defeaters; and it is not premise circular.  A person makes a competent deduction when they accept such an argument.  (Others use the term “competent deduction,” but they often mean something slightly different by the term, including Tucker (2010).)  One might think that competent deductions are the paradigm of good reasoning, that they must transmit justification to their conclusions.  Interest in transmission failure arises because, at first glance at least, there are such arguments that do seem to be instances of transmission failure.  Interest in transmission failure persists because it is very hard to identify what would cause such arguments to be instances of transmission failure.  Consider the following example.

Some philosophers, sometimes called “idealists,” hold that the only things that exist are minds and their ideas.  These idealists, therefore, are skeptics about material objects.  In other words, they reject that there are material objects, where material objects are non-mental objects composed of matter.  These philosophers tend to hold that there are ideas of hands but no hands.  There are ideas of chairs, even apparent perceptions of chairs, but there are no chairs.  Responding to these idealists, G. E. Moore declared that he could prove the existence of the external, or non-mental, world.  Here is his “proof”:

Moore’s Proof (MP)

(MP1)   I have a hand.

(If I have a hand, then there is at least one material object.)

(MP2)  There is at least one material object.

This argument is widely criticized and scorned.  Yet if it fails to transmit justification to its conclusion, why does it do so?

Well, Moore’s Proof is not an instance of transmission failure for any of the obvious reasons: it is a deductive argument; its premise seems well-justified on the basis of perceptual experience; there are no relevant defeaters; and it is not premise circular (that is, Moore did not—or at least need not—use MP2, the conclusion of Moore’s Proof, as a premise for his belief in MP1).  Still, it is hard to dispel the sense that this argument is bad.  This argument seems to beg the question against the skeptic, but it is unclear whether question-begging, by itself, can cause transmission failure (see sec. 5b).  Perhaps Moore’s Proof is not just question-begging, but also viciously circular in some way.  The problem is that it is hard to identify a type of circularity that both afflicts Moore’s argument and is clearly bad.

c. Two More Puzzling Cases

Moore’s Proof is a puzzling case.  If one accepts Moore’s Proof, she has made a competent deduction, which would seem to make it the paradigm of good reasoning.  Nonetheless, it still seems to be a bad argument.  The puzzling nature of this case also appears in a variety of other arguments, including the following two arguments.

Moore’s Proof is aimed at disproving idealism insofar as it is committed to skepticism about the material world, that is, the claim that the external world does not exist.  Consider, however, perceptual skepticism, the idea that, even if the external world does exist, our perceptual experiences do not give us knowledge (directly or via an inference) of this non-mental realm. Proponents of this skepticism typically concoct scenarios in which we would have exactly the same experiences that we do have, but where our perceptual experiences are wildly unreliable.  One popular scenario is that I am the unwitting victim of a mad scientist.  The mad scientist removed my brain, placed it in a vat of nutrients, and then hooked me up to his supercomputer.  In addition to keeping me alive, this supercomputer provides me with a computer generated reality, much like the virtual reality described by the movie Matrix.  Although all of my perceptual experiences are wildly unreliable, they seem just as genuine and trustworthy as my actual experiences.  The skeptic then reasons as follows: if you cannot tell whether you are merely a brain-in-a-vat in the above scenario, then you do not know you have a hand; you cannot tell whether you are a brain-in-a-vat (because your experiences would seem just as genuine even if you were a brain-in-a-vat); therefore, you do not know whether you have a hand.  (See Contemporary Skepticism, especially section 1, for further discussion of this type of skepticism.)

Some philosophers respond that the sort of reasoning in Moore’s Proof can be applied to rule out the skeptical hypothesis that we are brains-in-vats.  Hence:

The Neo-Moorean Argument

(NM1)    I have a hand.

(If I have a hand, then I am not a brain-in-a-vat.)

(NM2)    I am not a brain-in-a-vat.

The Neo-Moorean Argument is just as puzzling as Moore’s Proof.  If one accepts the Neo-Moorean Argument, she has accepted a competent deduction which seems to be the paradigm of good reasoning.  Yet the argument still seems bad, which is why some philosophers hold that it is an instance of transmission failure.

The Zebra Argument, like the Neo-Moorean Argument, is intended to rule out a certain kind of skeptical scenario.  Bobby is at the zoo and sees what appears to be zebra.  Quite naturally, he believes that the creature is a zebra on the basis of its looking like one.  His son, however, is not convinced and asks: “Dad, if a mule is disguised cleverly enough, it will look just like a real zebra.  So how do you know that the creature isn’t a cleverly disguised mule?”  Bobby answers his son’s question with:

The Zebra Argument

(Z1)        That creature is a zebra.

(If it is a zebra, then it is not a cleverly disguised mule.)

(Z2)        It is not a cleverly disguised mule.

It seems that to know that the creature is a zebra, one must know already in some sense that the creature is not a cleverly disguised mule.  Hence, Bobby’s argument seems to exhibit a suspicious type of circularity despite qualifying as a competent deduction.

(There is a rather wide variety of other puzzling cases.  For reasons that will be explained in the next section, arguments that allegedly violate closure principles are also potential examples of transmission failure.  Readers interested in semantic or content externalism should consider McKinsey’s Paradox in section 5 of the closure principles article.  Readers with expertise in the philosophy of mind might be interested in some examples raised by Davies (2003: secs. 3, 5).)

4. Transmission (Failure) vs. Closure (Failure)

Discussions of transmission and transmission failure are connected intimately with discussions of closure and closure failure, which raises the question of how these issues are related.

a. The Basic Difference

Closure principles say, roughly, that if one thing a has some property P and bears some relation R to another thing b, then b also will have P.  More succinctly (and ignoring universal quantification for simplicity’s sake), closure principles say that, if Pa and Rab, then Pb.  Suppose that the property being a pig is closed under the relation being the same species as.  Suppose, in other words, that if Albert is a pig, then anything that is the same species as Albert is also a pig.  Given this assumption, if Albert is a pig and Brutus is the same species as Albert, then Brutus is a pig.  Yet being a pig is clearly not closed under the relation being the same genus as.  Pigs are in the genus mammal along with humans, cows, poodles, and many other creatures.  If Albert is a pig and Brutus is in the same genus as Albert, it does not follow that Brutus is a pig.  Brutus could be a terribly ferocious poodle and still be in the same genus as Albert.

In epistemological contexts, the relevant P will be an epistemic property, such as being justified or known, and R will be something like being competently deduced from or being known to entail.  An epistemic closure principle might say: If Billy knows P and Billy competently deduces Q from P, then Billy also knows Q.

Transmission principles are stronger than their closure counterparts.  Transmission principles, in other words, say everything that their closure counterparts say and more besides.  Recall that closure principles hold that, if Pa and Rab, then Pb.   Transmission principles hold instead that, if Pa and Rab, then Pb in virtue of Pa. Closure principles merely say that b has the property P, but they do not specify why b has that property.  Transmission principles say not only that b has P, but also that b has P because, or in virtue of, Pa and Rab.

Notice that a closure principle can be true when the corresponding transmission principle is false.  Consider:

Pig Closure: If Albert is a pig and is the same species as Brutus, then Brutus is also a pig.

Pig Transmission: If Albert is a pig and is the same species as Brutus, then Brutus is a pig in virtue of Albert’s being a pig.

Even though we are assuming that Pig Closure is true, Pig Transmission will be false when Albert and Brutus are unrelated pigs.  Brutus’ being a pig might be explained by his parents being pigs and/or his having a certain DNA structure, but not by Albert’s being a pig.  Although closure principles can be true when their transmission counterparts are false, if a transmission principle is true, its closure counterpart must also be true.  This is because transmission principles say everything that their closure counterparts say (and more besides).

Epistemic closure principles likewise can be true when their transmission counterparts are false.

Simple Closure: If S knows that P and deduces Q from P, then S knows that Q.

Simple Transmission: If S knows that P and deduces Q from P, then S knows that Q in virtue of knowing that P.

Even supposing Simple Closure is true (which it probably is not), Simple Transmission is false.  Suppose S knows Q on the basis of perceptual experience and then comes to know P on the basis of her knowing Q.  It would be premise circular if she then also based her belief in Q on her belief in P.  If she did so, her extended argument would be Q therefore P therefore Q.  It is plausible in such a case that S still knows the conclusion Q on the basis of the relevant perceptual experience.  Assuming she still knows Q, her deduction from P to Q is not a counterexample to Simple Closure.  On the other hand, this case is a clear counterexample to Simple Transmission.  Although she knows Q, she knows it in virtue of the perceptual experience, not deducing it from her knowledge that P.

The difference between closure and transmission principles was just explained.  Next, the difference between closure and transmission failure will be explained.  There is an instance of closure failure when Pa and Rab hold, but Pb does not.  Simple Closure suffers from closure failure just in case someone deduces Q from her knowledge that P but nonetheless fails to know that Q.  An instance of simple closure failure just is a counterexample to Simple Closure.

There is an instance of transmission failure whenever it is false that Pb in virtue of Pa and Rab.  There are three types of transmission failure which correspond to the three ways in which it might be false that Pb holds in virtue of Pa and Rab.  The first type occurs just in case either Pa or Rab does not hold.  If Pa and Rab do not hold, then Pb cannot hold in virtue of Pa and Rab.  Consequently, Rab would fail to transmit P from a to b.  Notice that this first type of transmission failure can occur even if the relevant transmission principle is true.  Transmission principles do not say that Pa and Rab in fact hold; instead they say if Pa and Rab hold, then Pb holds in virtue of Pa and Rab.  If S fails to know P or fails to deduce Q from P, then the deduction fails to transmit knowledge from P to Q.  Nonetheless, Simple Transmission might still be true, because it does not demand that S actually deduce Q from her knowledge that P.  A similar point explains why one can have type-one transmission failure without having closure failure, that is, without having a counterexample to the corresponding closure principle.  There is, therefore, an interesting difference between transmission and closure failure: an instance of closure failure just is a counterexample to some relevant closure principle, but an instance of transmission failure need not be a counterexample to some relevant transmission principle.

Although the first type of transmission failure never provides a counterexample to some relevant transmission principle, the second and third types always provide such a counterexample. The second type occurs just in case Pa and Rab holds but Pb does not—precisely the same circumstances in which closure failure occurs.  In other words, the second type of transmission failure occurs just in case closure failure does.  It follows that all instances of closure failure are instances of transmission failure.  It does not follow, however, that all instances of transmission failure are instances of closure failure: there will be transmission failure without closure failure whenever there is transmission failure of the first or third types.  Simple Transmission suffers from type-two transmission failure (and closure failure) just in case S deduces Q from her knowledge that P but nonetheless fails to know Q.  (The idea that all instances of closure failure are instances of transmission failure but not vice versa also follows from the fact that transmission principles say everything that their closure counterparts say and more besides.  By saying everything that closure principles say, transmission principles will fail whenever their closure counterparts do.  By saying more than their closure counterparts, they sometimes will fail even when their closure counterparts do not.)

The third type of transmission failure occurs just in case Pa, Rab, and Pb hold, but Pb does not hold in virtue of Pa and Rab.  Since closure principles do not demand that Pb hold in virtue of Pa and Rab, a closure principle may be true even if its corresponding transmission principle suffers from type-three transmission failure.  Simple Transmission suffers from type-three transmission failure just in case S deduces Q from S’s knowledge that P, S knows Q, but S does not know Q in virtue of the deduction from her knowledge that P.  The premise circular argument discussed in this sub-section is a plausible example of this type of failure.  As was explained above, in such a case Simple Closure might hold but Simple Transmission would not.

b. The (Misplaced?) Focus on Closure

There is no doubt that, in the epistemological literature, closure failure is in some sense the bigger issue.  Some epistemological theories seem committed to rejecting intuitive closure principles, and there is extensive debate over how serious of a crime it is to reject these principles.  Although the literature on transmission failure is by no means scant, considerably more ink has been spilt over closure failure.  One naturally is inclined to infer that closure failure is the more important issue, but this may be incorrect: the literature’s focus on closure failure may be misplaced—though this potential misplacement is likely harmless.

Crispin Wright (1985: 438, nt. 1) was perhaps the first to distinguish between epistemic closure and transmission principles, but much of the literature has not observed this distinction, a fact that has been noted by Wright (2003: 76, nt.1) and Davies (2000: 394, nt. 19).  When some philosophers purport to talk about closure principles, they are really talking about transmission principles.  Consider Williamson’s “intuitive closure” principle: “knowing p1,…,pn, competently deducing q, and thereby coming to believe q is in general a way of coming to know q” (2000: 117, emphasis mine).  Closure principles can tell us that everything we competently deduce from prior knowledge itself will be known; however, only transmission principles can tell us the how, that is, that the conclusions are known in virtue of the competent deductions.  Hawthorne likewise treats closure principles as if they were transmission ones: “Our closure principles are perfectly general principles concerning how knowledge can be gained by deductive inference from prior knowledge” (2004: 36, emphasis mine).  Closure principles can tell us that everything we competently deduce from prior knowledge itself will be known; however, only transmission principles can tell us that our knowledge of these conclusions was gained by the deduction from prior knowledge.

Dretske’s 1970 paper “Epistemic Operators” introduced the epistemological world to the issue of closure failure, and his subsequent work on the topic has been extremely important.  Yet even he now admits that discussing transmission failure “provides a more revealing way” of explaining some of his key claims concerning closure failure (2005: 15).  One wonders, then, whether the literature’s greater focus on closure failure is (harmlessly?) misplaced.

c. Why Transmission is an Interesting Issue, Revisited

Although it seems salutary to appreciate the distinction between closure and transmission failure, it may be that some philosophers read too much into this distinction.  Although Wright holds that certain competent deductions are instances of transmission failure, he is “skeptical whether there are any genuine counterexamples to closure” (2002: 332; 2003: 57-8; cf. 2000: 157).  Davies seems sympathetic to a similar position at times (2000: 394) but not at others (1998: 326).  These remarks suggest the following way of explaining why transmission is an interesting issue: “Moore’s Proof seems to be a bad argument, but intuitive closure principles seem too plausible to reject.  This tension can be resolved when Moore’s Proof is treated as an instance of transmission rather than closure failure.  Moore’s Proof seems to be a bad argument and is a bad argument because it fails to transmit justification to its conclusion; it is not, however, a counterexample to intuitive closure principles.”

Smith (2009: 181) comes closest to endorsing this motivation explicitly, but even if it is not widely held, it is worth explaining why it fails.  To do so, two new closure principles need to be introduced.  Simple Closure and Simple Transmission were discussed in 4.A in order to provide a clear case in which a transmission principle is false even if its closure counterpart is true.  Yet Simple Closure is too simple to be plausible.  For example, it fails to account for defeaters (for example, relevant counterevidence).  If S deduces Q from her knowledge that P, then Simple Closure says that S knows Q.  Yet if S makes that deduction even though her total evidence supports ~Q, she will not know Q.

When philosophers defend closure principles, they typically defend, not Simple Closure, but something like:

Strong Closure: If S knows P and S competently deduces Q from P, then S knows that Q.

Simple Closure holds that knowledge is closed over deductions.  Strong Closure, on the other hand, holds that knowledge is closed over competent deductions.  Recall from 3.B that a deduction is competent just in case the premises are well justified; the premises provide deductive (so maximal) support for their conclusions; the subject knows that the premises provide deductive support; there are no relevant defeaters; and it is not premise circular.  Given that competent deductions seem, at first glance at least, to be the paradigm of good reasoning (see 3.B), it should not be surprising that philosophers defend something like Strong Closure.

The second closure principle that needs to be introduced is:

Weak Closure: If S knows P and S competently deduces Q from P, then S has some epistemic status for Q, no matter how weak.

Suppose S competently deduces Q from her knowledge that P.  Strong Closure holds that S must know Q.  Weak Closure, on the other hand, says only that S must have some positive epistemic status for Q, no matter how weak.  (It is worth noting that, despite its name, Weak Closure is not obviously a closure principle.  Closure principles say that if Pa and Rab, then Pb (see 4.A).  If there are three different epistemic properties P, Q, and R, then Weak Closure is in this form: if Pa and Rab, then Pb or Qb or Rb.  This concern can be ignored, because if Weak Closure fails to count as a closure principle, then there would only be further problems with the above motivation.)

Wright (2004), Davies (2003: 29-30), and perhaps also Smith (2009: 180-1) endorse an account of non-inferential knowledge which allows them to endorse Weak Closure but not Strong Closure.  (McLaughlin 2003: 91-2 endorses a similar view, but it is not clear that his explanation of transmission failure is compatible with even Weak Closure.)  Put simply, they hold that to have (strong) non-inferential justification for P, one must have prior entitlement for certain background assumptions.  An entitlement to some background assumption A is something like a very weak justification for A that one has automatically, or by default.  Since they suppose (as is common) that knowledge requires the strong type of justification, they also hold that non-inferential knowledge likewise requires this prior weak and default justification for background assumptions.  (The most extensive defense of this view of non-inferential justification is Wright’s 2004.  See Tucker’s 2009 for a criticism of this view as it relates to perceptual justification.)

Applied to Moore’s Proof, this view holds that, to have non-inferential knowledge that one has a hand (the premise of Moore’s Proof), she must have some prior entitlement to accept that there are material things (the conclusion of Moore’s Proof).  Since the conclusion of Moore’s Proof would not be used as a sub-premise to establish that one has hands, it would not count as premise circular.  Nonetheless, since knowing the premise would require some previous (however weak) justification for the conclusion, this view of non-inferential justification makes Moore’s Proof circular in some other sense.  Does this type of circularity prevent the premise from transmitting knowledge to the conclusion?  Wright and Davies certainly think so, but Cohen (1999:76-7, 87, nt. 52) is more optimistic.  If Wright and Davies are correct, then one has some very weak justification for the conclusion of Moore’s Proof, but they do not and cannot know this conclusion.  Since the conclusion, that there are material things, does have some weak epistemic status, Wright and Davies can endorse Weak Closure.  Yet they are forced to reject Strong Closure because they hold that one cannot know that there are material things.

The ability to endorse Weak Closure is not enough for the above way of motivating the issue of transmission failure to succeed.  Strong Closure (or some principle in the general neighborhood) is what most epistemologists find too plausible to reject.  Since Wright and Davies must reject Strong Closure, their diagnosis of Moore’s Proof cannot explain the badness of Moore’s Proof without rejecting the version of closure that most philosophers find intuitive.  (See Silins 2005: 89-95 for related discussion.)

Something like Strong Closure seems extremely plausible even to those who ultimately reject it (for example, Dretske 2005: 18).  But why does it seem so plausible?  Tucker (2010: 498-9) holds that it seems so plausible because its corresponding transmission principle seems so plausible.  Consider:

Strong Transmission: If S knows P and S competently deduces Q from P, then S knows that Q in virtue of that competent deduction.

Strong Transmission says what Strong Closure says and that the conclusion is justified in virtue of that competent deduction.  Tucker’s suggestion is that Strong Closure seems plausible because Strong Transmission seem plausible.  It seems that justification is closed over a competent deduction because it seems competent deductions must transmit justification to their conclusions, a point discussed above in section 2.B.  From this point of view, it is no surprise to find that the literature often treats closure principles as if they were transmission ones, for our intuitions concerning transmission would explain why certain closure principles seem so plausible.

5. Transmission Failure: Two Common Assumptions

It is commonly held that Moore’s Proof, the Neo-Moorean Argument, and the Zebra Argument are instances of transmission failure.  When philosophers attempt to explain why these arguments fail to transmit, they tend to make two assumptions.

a. Transmission of Warrant vs. Transmission of Justification

Much of the literature on transmission failure focuses on the transmission of warrant rather than the transmission of (doxastic) justification (see Wright 1985, 2002, 2003; Davies 1998, 2000, 2003; and Dretske 2005).  A warrant for P, roughly, is something that counts in favor of accepting P.  An evidential warrant for P is some (inferential or non-inferential) evidence that counts in favor of accepting P.  Entitlement, which was discussed in 4.B, is a type of non-evidential warrant for P, a warrant that one has by default.  One can have a warrant for P even if she does not believe P or believes P but not on the basis of the warrant.  Notice that it is propositions that are warranted relative to a person.

(Doxastic) justification, on the other hand, is a property that beliefs have.  Roughly, a belief is justified when it is held in an epistemically appropriate way.  S is justified in believing P only if (i) S has warrant for P and (ii) S’s belief in P is appropriately connected to that warrant for P.  Hence, one can have warrant for a belief even though it is not justified.  Suppose Merla has some genuine evidential warrant for her belief that Joey is innocent, so her belief satisfies (i); but her belief will not be justified if she believes that Joey is innocent solely because the Magic 8-Ball says so.  Although Merla would have warrant for Joey’s innocence, her belief in his innocence would not be connected appropriately to that warrant.  In other words, her belief would not be justified because it would not satisfy (ii).

Again, Wright, Davies, and Dretske focus on the transmission of warrant, not justification. In a representative statement, Davies maintains that “The question is whether the epistemic warrants that I have for believing the premises add up to an epistemically adequate warrant for the conclusion” (2000: 399, cf. 2003: 51). Dretske focuses more specifically on the transmission of evidential warrant.  Transmission failure, he says, is the idea “that some reasons for believing P do not transmit to things, Q, known to be implied by P” (15).  These philosophers hold that Moore’s Proof fails to transmit in the sense that it fails to make the warrant for its premise warrant for its conclusion.

These philosophers assume, however, that the failure to transmit warrant suffices for the failure to transmit justification.  In other words, they make:

Common Assumption 1: if an argument fails to transmit warrant, then it fails to transmit justification.

The difference between these two types of transmission failure is subtle.  To say that an argument fails to transmit justification is to say that an argument fails to make its conclusion justified.  To say that an argument fails to transmit warrant is to say that the argument fails to make belief in its conclusion justified in a very particular way, namely by converting warrant for the premise into warrant for the conclusion.

Davies, Wright, and, to a lesser extent, Dretske reveal this assumption when they discuss the significance of failing to transmit warrant.  Wright assumes that when an argument fails to transmit warrant, it is not an argument “whereby someone could be moved to rational [or justified] conviction of its conclusion” (2000: 140).  In one paragraph, Davies seems to suppose, at the very least, that “limitations on the transmission of epistemic warrants” suffice for “limitations on our ability to achieve knowledge [and presumably also justification] by inference” (2003: 35-6).  Although there is no one passage that illustrates this, Dretske (2005) assumes that an evidential warrant’s failing to transmit prevents knowledge (and presumably also justification) from transmitting.

This first assumption is significant because the transmission of justification seems to be the more important type of transmission. When we evaluate the quality of arguments (insofar as they are used to organize one’s beliefs) we want to know whether we can justifiably believe the conclusion in virtue of accepting the argument.  Whether an argument transmits warrant is usually relevant to this aim only insofar as it implies something about when the argument transmits justification.

Silins (2005: 87-88) and Tucker (2010: 505-7) criticize this first assumption.  Suppose that Harold’s belief in P is doxastically justified by his evidence E; he notices that P entails Q; and then he subsequently deduces Q from P.  According to Silins and Tucker, it is natural to identify Harold’s reason for accepting Q as P, not E.  Since we are supposing that P entails Q, P is presumably a warrant for Q.  But if P is Harold’s reason for Q and is itself a warrant for Q, it does not seem to matter whether the deduction transmits warrant, that is, whether the deduction makes E into a warrant for Q.  It is worth noting that, even if Common Assumption 1 is ultimately correct, Tucker and Silins still have a point: this assumption is not sufficiently obvious to be taken for granted, as Wright, Dretske, and Davies do.

b. Transmission vs. Resolving Doubt

The second common assumption may be the more important.  It says that failing to have the power to resolve doubt suffices for failing to transmit justification.  In other words:

Common Assumption 2: if an argument fails to have the power to resolve doubt, then it fails to transmit justification to its conclusion.

A deduction P therefore C has the power to resolve doubt (about its conclusion) iff it is possible for one to go from doubting C to justified belief in C solely in virtue of accepting P therefore C.  As I am using the term, one (seriously) doubts P just in case she either disbelieves or withholds judgment about P.  Withholding judgment is more than merely failing to believe or disbelieve P: it is resisting or refraining from both believing and disbelieving P, and one cannot do that unless one has considered P.

Suppose that Hillbilly has been very out of the loop the last few years, and he doubts that Obama is the president.  He then discovers that both CNN and the NY Times say that he is the president.  He might justifiably infer that, after all, Obama is the president.  This is because the argument he would accept has the power to resolve doubt.  On the other hand, the Neo-Moorean Argument, for example, does not have the power to resolve doubt.  If one doubts NM2, that she is not a brain-in-a-vat, she cannot rationally believe, NM1, that she has a hand.  So doubting the conclusion of the Neo-Moorean Argument prevents a key premise in the argument from being justified, thereby preventing the argument from justifying the conclusion.  Since the argument cannot justify its conclusion when the subject antecedently disbelieves or withholds judgment about the conclusion, it lacks the power to resolve doubt.

Wright (2002, 2003), Davies (2003), and McLaughlin (2000) make this second assumption. Wright maintains that “Intuitively, a transmissible warrant should make for the possible advancement of knowledge, or warranted belief, and the overcoming of doubt or agnosticism” (2002: 332, emphasis mine).  In another paper, he says of an example that, “The inference from A to B is thus not at the service of addressing an antecedent agnosticism about B.  So my warrant does not transmit” (2003: 63).

Davies’ (2003) Limitation Principles for the transmission of warrant are, he thinks, motivated “by making use of the idea that failure of transmission of epistemic warrant is the analogue, within the thought of a single subject, of the dialectical phenomenon of begging the question” (41).  In Davies’ view, “The speaker begs the question against the hearer if the hearer’s doubt rationally requires him to adopt background assumptions relative to which the considerations that are supposed to support the speaker’s premises no longer provide that support” (41).  Take the Zebra Argument.  If you doubted Z2, that the animal is not a cleverly disguised mule, then Davies suggests that your perceptual experience will no longer count in favor of your belief in Z1, that the animal is a zebra.  So if I offered you the Zebra Argument in order to convince you that the animal is not a cleverly disguised mule, I would beg the question against you.

It is pretty clear, as Davies’ discussion suggests, that accepting an argument that fails to be a “question-settling justification,” that is, accepting an argument lacking the power to resolve doubt, is the analogue of the dialectical phenomenon of begging the question (for example, 2003: 41-5, esp. 42).  Were I to accept the Zebra Argument when I have antecedent doubt about its conclusion, I would, as it were, beg the question against myself.  Yet Davies never provides any reason to believe that transmission failure is an analogue of begging the question.  He seems to take for granted that for something (for example, an experience or argument) to be a justification at all, it must have the power to resolve doubt.

McLaughlin’s (2000) primary concern is with the transmission of knowledge, not justification, but he seems to make a parallel assumption.  He says the Neo-Moorean Argument cannot transmit knowledge because it begs the question: “The premises fail to provide a sufficient epistemic basis on which to know the conclusion because my basis for one of the premises is dependent on the truth of the conclusion in such a way as to render the argument question begging” (104).  It is Neo-Moorean Argument’s inability to resolve doubt that makes it question-begging.  Hence, McLaughlin seems to assume that the power to resolve doubt is required for the power to make a conclusion known.

Much of the literature on transmission failure, then, operates on the assumption that the power to justify requires the power to resolve doubt.  Taking this assumption for granted was probably a reasonable thing to do at the time the literature was first published; however, this assumption is now challenged most directly by Pryor (2004), but Markie (2005: 409) and Bergmann (2006: 198-200) challenge similar assumptions in connection with easy knowledge and epistemic circularity, respectively.  Although Davies initially endorses Common Assumption 2, he seems inclined to reject it in his later work (2004: 242-3).  Those who challenge this assumption first emphasize (though not necessarily in these words) the conceptual distinction between transmission failure and the inability to resolve doubt, and then they contend that we need some special reason to think that the inability to resolve doubt suffices for transmission failure.

Sometimes philosophers press similar distinctions in different terminology, and it is worth explaining the connection with one other popular way of talking.  Some (for example, Pryor 2004: 369) hold that Moore’s Proof can transmit justification even though it is dialectically ineffective for some audiences.  An argument is dialectically effective for an audience when it is one that will transmit justification (knowledge) to the argument’s conclusion given the audience’s current beliefs, experiences, and other epistemically relevant factors.  Consider again Hillbilly’s argument that Two reliable sources, namely CNN and NY Times, say that Obama is the president; therefore, Obama is the president.  This argument is dialectically effective for Hillbilly because he has no antecedent doubt about the reliability of CNN and NY Times.  This same argument nonetheless may be dialectically ineffective for his cousin if the cousin antecedently doubts (rationally or irrationally) the reliability of these two news outlets.  Before this argument will be dialectically effective for the cousin, her antecedent doubt must be resolved.

Defenders of Moore’s Proof sometimes say that the “proof” is dialectically effective for audiences that lack antecedent doubt in the argument’s conclusion that there are no material things, but not for its intended audience, namely those skeptical of this conclusion.  Moore’s Proof fails to be dialectically effective for this skeptical audience because such skeptics tend to doubt the reliability of perception.

Appreciating the distinction between transmission failure and the inability to resolve doubt (or dialectical effectiveness) not only casts doubt on Common Assumption 2, but also provides proponents of Moore’s Proof with an error theory.  In general, an error theory attempts to explain why something seems true when it is not.  The proponent of Moore’s Proof wants to explain why Moore’s Proof seems to be an instance of transmission failure when it is not.  In other words, this error theory attempts to explain away the intuition that Moore’s Proof is an instance of transmission failure.  The proponent of this error theory will say that this intuition is partly right and partly wrong.  What it gets right is that Moore’s Proof exhibits a genuine failure, namely the failure to resolve doubt (and/or be dialectically effective for its target audience).  What it gets wrong is that Moore’s Proof is an instance of transmission failure.  Yet, since it is easy to conflate the two types of failure, it is easy to mistakenly think that Moore’s Proof is an instance of transmission failure too.

The success of this error theory depends on at least two factors.  The first is whether transmission failure and the inability to resolve doubt are in fact easily confused.  This seems plausible given the widespread tendency to implicitly endorse Common Assumption 2 without comment.  The second is whether one retains the intuition that Moore’s Proof is an instance of transmission failure.  If, after considering this error theory and carefully distinguishing transmission failure from the inability to resolve doubt, one no longer has the intuition that Moore’s Proof is a bad argument, then the error theory seems promising.  If, however, one retains the intuition that Moore’s Proof is a bad argument, it is far less plausible that the intuition of transmission failure arises from conflating transmission failure with the inability to resolve doubt.  Consequently, the error theory would seem considerably less promising.  (Wright 2008 responds to Pryor’s version of this error theory, a response which is criticized by Tucker's 2010: 523-4.)

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bergmann, Michael. 2006. Justification without Awareness. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • In Chapter 7, Bergmann makes a distinction similar to the transmission/resolving doubt distinction and uses it to defend some instances of epistemic circularity.
  • Cohen, Stewart. 1999. “Contextualism, Skepticism, and the Structure of Reasons.” Philosophical Perspectives 13: 57-89.
    • Cohen’s main goal is to defend epistemic contextualism, but he also seems to approve of a type of circularity that Davies and Wright find vicious (see 76-7, 87, nt. 52).
  • Davies, Martin. 2004. “Epistemic Entitlement, Warrant Transmission, and Easy Knowledge.” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 78: 213-45.
    • In this paper, Davies distances himself from his earlier work on transmission failure and seems sympathetic to the error theory discussed in 5.B.
  • Davies, Martin. 2003. “The Problem of Armchair Knowledge.” In Nuccetelli 23-56.
    • In this paper, Davies defends his early views concerning transmission failure, but perhaps its most useful contribution is that it considers a wide variety of cases that he holds are instances of transmission failure (see especially section 5).
  • Davies, Martin. 2000. “Externalism and Armchair Knowledge.” In Boghossian, Paul and Christopher Peacocke (eds.) 384-414.
    • This paper is probably the place to start for those interested in Davies’ early views on transmission failure.
  • Davies, Martin. 1998. “Externalism, Architecturalism, and Epistemic Warrant.” In Wright, Crispin, C. Smith, and C. Macdonald (eds.). Knowing Our Own Minds. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pgs. 321- 361.
    • Davies presents his initial views on transmission failure, which he refines in his 2000 and 2003 and then apparently reconsiders in his 2004.
  • Dretske, Fred. 2005. “The Case against Closure.” In Steup, Matthias and Ernest Sosa (eds.). Contemporary Debates in Epistemology. Malden: Blackwell Publishing, 13-25.
    • Dretske defends his view that closure principles are false, and, in sec. 1, he explains how some of what he says about closure failure in his earlier work can be better expressed in terms of transmission failure.
  • Dretske, Fred. 1970. “Epistemic Operators” Journal of Philosophy 67: 1007-23.
    • Dretske introduces closure failure as an issue for discussion, but his 2005 provides a simpler introduction to the closure failure issue.
  • Hawthorne, John. 2005. “The Case for Closure.” In Steup, Matthias and Ernest Sosa (eds.). Contemporary Debates in Epistemology. Malden: Blackwell Publishing, 26-42.
    • Hawthorne defends intuitive closure principles and criticizes Dretske’s views regarding closure (and transmission) failure.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2006.  “Introduction.” In Lackey, Jennifer and Ernest Sosa (eds.). The Epistemology of Testimony. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • In Section 3, Lackey briefly discusses some of the transmission issues concerning testimony.
  • Markie, Peter J. “Easy Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 70: 406-16.
    • Markie discusses some competent deductions that seem to be instances of transmission failure (though he does not use that terminology), and he provides an error theory of the sort discussed in section 5.B above.
  • McKinsey, Michael. 2003. “Transmission of Warrant and Closure of Apriority.”
    • In Nuccetelli 97-115.  McKinsey responds to Wright (2000) and Davies’ (1998, 2000, 2003) charge that McKinsey’s Paradox is an instance of transmission failure.
  • McLaughlin, Brian. 2003. “McKinsey’s Challenge, Warrant Transmission, and Skepticism.”  In Nuccetelli 79-96.
    • McLaughlin provides an objection to Wright’s 2000 conditions for transmission failure, which convinces Wright to modify those conditions in his later work.  It also provides a careful discussion of whether McKinsey’s Paradox is an instance of transmission failure.
  • McLaughlin, Brian. 2000. “Skepticism, Externalism, and Self-Knowledge.” The Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 74: 93-118.
    • On pages 104-5, McLaughlin connects transmission failure with question-begging and claims that the Neo-Moorean argument is an instance of transmission failure.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana (ed.). 2003. New Essays on Semantic Externalism and Self-Knowledge. Cambridge: MIT Press.
    • Several chapters of this collection were referenced in this article.
  • Pryor, James. 2004. “What’s Wrong with Moore’s Argument.” Philosophical Issues 14: 349-77.
    • Pryor defends Moore’s Proof from the charge of transmission failure, which includes a very careful discussion of the error theory discussed in 5.B.
  • Silins, Nicholas. 2005. “Transmission Failure Failure.” Philosophical Studies 126: 71-102.
    • Silins defends the Zebra Argument from the charge of transmission failure and provides detailed criticisms of the views of Wright and Davies.
  • Smith, Martin. 2009. “Transmission Failure Explained.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 79: 164-89.
    • Smith provides an account of transmission failure in terms of safety and reliability.  A full appreciation of Smith’s view requires at least some background in modal logic, particularly with counterfactuals, or subjunctive conditionals.
  • Tucker, Chris. 2010. "When Transmission Fails." Philosophical Review 119: 497-529.
    • Tucker defends the Neo-Moorean and Zebra arguments by developing and defending a very permissive account of transmission failure. Much of this entry is merely a simplified version of the first half of Tucker's 2010 paper.
  • Tucker, Chris. 2009. “Perceptual Justification and Warrant by Default.”  Australasian Journal of Philosophy 87: 445-63.
    • This paper attacks the view of non-inferential justification that Wright, and, to a lesser extent, Smith, Davies, and McLaughlin (2003) assume in their work on transmission failure.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • This book contains some important work on closure failure that is equally work on transmission failure.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2008. “The Perils of Dogmatism.” Themes from G. E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 25-48.
    • Wright criticizes an alternative to his account of non-inferential justification and, on page 38, he criticizes Pryor’s version of the error theory discussed in 5.B.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2004. “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 78: 167- 212.
    • Wright’s extended defense of his account of non-inferential justification.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2003. “Some Reflections on the Acquisition of Warrant by Inference.” In Nuccetelli 57-78.
    • The place to start for those interested in understanding Wright’s account of transmission failure as it relates to McKinsey’s Paradox and content externalism.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2002. “(Anti)-Sceptics Simple and Subtle: G. E. Moore and John McDowell.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 65: 330-348.
    • The place to start for those interested in Wright’s account of transmission failure as it relates to perceptual justification.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2000. “Cogency and Question-Begging: Some Reflections on McKinsey’s Paradox and Putnam’s Proof.” Philosophical Issues 10: 140-63.
    • Wright provides a transmission failure principle which he refines in his 2002 and 2003 in light of McLaughlin’s 2003 criticism.
  • Wright, Crispin. 1985. “Facts and Certainty.” Proceedings of the British Academy, 429-472. Reprinted in Williams, Michael (ed.). 1993. Skepticism. Aldershot: Dartmouth Publishing Company Limited, pgs. 303-346.
    • Wright’s earliest work on transmission failure and perhaps the first paper to distinguish between closure and transmission principles.  Since Wright’s main focus is not transmission failure, you might start with one of Wright’s later papers unless one is very interested in the full details of Wright’s broadly Wittgensteinian epistemology.

Author Information

Chris Tucker
Email: c.tucker@auckland.ac.nz
University of Auckland
New Zealand

Foundationalism

Epistemic foundationalism is a view about the proper structure of one’s knowledge or justified beliefs.  Some beliefs are known or justifiedly believed only because some other beliefs are known or justifiedly believed.  For example, you can know that you have heart disease only if you know some other claims such as your doctors report this and doctors are reliable.  The support these beliefs provide for your belief that you have heart disease illustrates that your first belief is epistemically dependent on these other two beliefs.  This epistemic dependence naturally raises the question about the proper epistemic structure for our beliefs.  Should all beliefs be supported by other beliefs?  Are some beliefs rightly believed apart from receiving support from other beliefs?  What is the nature of the proper support between beliefs?  Epistemic foundationalism is one view about how to answer these questions.  Foundationalists maintain that some beliefs are properly basic and that the rest of one’s beliefs inherit their epistemic status (knowledge or justification) in virtue of receiving proper support from the basic beliefs.  Foundationalists have two main projects: a theory of proper basicality (that is, a theory of noninferential justification) and a theory of appropriate support (that is, a theory of inferential justification).

Foundationalism has a long history.  Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics argues for foundationalism on the basis of the regress argument.  Aristotle assumes that the alternatives to foundationalism must either endorse circular reasoning or land in an infinite regress of reasons.  Because neither of these views is plausible, foundationalism comes out as the clear winner in an argument by elimination.  Arguably, the most well known foundationalist is Descartes, who takes as the foundation the allegedly indubitable knowledge of his own existence and the content of his ideas.  Every other justified belief must be grounded ultimately in this knowledge.

The debate over foundationalism was reinvigorated in the early part of the twentieth century by the debate over the nature of the scientific method.  Otto Neurath (1959; original 1932) argued for a view of scientific knowledge illuminated by the raft metaphor according to which there is no privileged set of statements that serve as the ultimate foundation; rather knowledge arises out of a coherence among the set of statements we accept.  In opposition to this raft metaphor, Moritz Schlick (1959; original 1932) argued for a view of scientific knowledge akin to the pyramid image in which knowledge rests on a special class of statements whose verification doesn’t depend on other beliefs.

The Neurath-Schlick debate transformed into a discussion over nature and role of observation sentences within a theory.  Quine (1951) extended this debate with his metaphor of the web of belief in which observation sentences are able to confirm or disconfirm a hypothesis only in connection with a larger theory.  Sellars (1963) criticizes foundationalism as endorsing a flawed model of the cognitive significance of experience.  Following the work of Quine and Sellars, a number of people arose to defend foundationalism (see section below on modest foundationalism).  This touched off a burst of activity on foundationalism in the late 1970s to early 1980s.  One of the significant developments from this period is the formulation and defense of reformed epistemology, a foundationalist view that took as the foundations beliefs such as there is a God (see Plantinga (1983)). While the debate over foundationalism has abated in recent decades, new work has picked up on neglected topics about the architecture of knowledge and justification.

Table of Contents

  1. Knowledge and Justification
  2. Arguments for Foundationalism
    1. The Regress Argument
    2. Natural Judgment about Cases
  3. Arguments against Foundationalism
    1. The Problem of Arbitrariness
    2. The Sellarsian Dilemma
  4. Types of Foundationalist Views
    1. Theories of Noninferential Justification
      1. Strong Foundationalism
      2. Modest Foundationalism
      3. Weak Foundationalism
    2. Theories of Proper Inference
      1. Deductivism
      2. Strict Inductivism
      3. Liberal Inductivism
      4. A Theory of Inference and A Theory of Concepts
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Knowledge and Justification

The foundationalist attempts to answer the question: what is the proper structure of one’s knowledge or justified beliefs? This question assumes a prior grasp of the concepts of knowledge and justification.  Before the development of externalist theories of knowledge (see entry on internalism and externalism in epistemology) it was assumed that knowledge required justification.  On a standard conception of knowledge, knowledge was justified true belief.  Thus investigation on foundationalism focused on the structural conditions for justification.  How should one’s beliefs be structured so as to be justified?  The following essay discusses foundationalism in terms of justification (see BonJour (1985) for a defense of the claim that knowledge requires justification).  Where the distinction between justification and knowledge is relevant (for example, weak foundationalism), this article will observe it.

What is it for a belief to be justified?  Alvin Plantinga (1993) observes that the notion of justification is heavily steeped in deontological terms, terms like rightness, obligation, and duty.  A belief is justified for a person if and only if the person is right to believe it or the subject has fulfilled her intellectual duties relating to the belief.  Laurence BonJour (1985) presents a slightly different take on the concept of justification stating that it is “roughly that of a reason or warrant of some kind meeting some appropriate standard” (pp., 5-6).  This ‘appropriate standard’ conception of justification permits a wider understanding of the concept of justification.  BonJour, for instance, takes the distinguishing characteristic of justification to be “its essential or internal relation to the cognitive goal of truth” (p. 8).  Most accounts of justification assume some form of epistemic internalism.  Roughly speaking, this is the view that a belief’s justification does not require that it meets some condition external to a subject’s perspective, conditions such as being true, being produced by a reliable process, or being caused by the corresponding fact (see entry on internalism and externalism in epistemology).  All the relevant conditions for justification are ‘internal’ to a subject’s perspective.  These conditions vary from facts about a subject’s occurrent beliefs and experiences to facts about a subject’s occurrent and stored beliefs and experiences and further to facts simply about a subject’s mind, where this may include information that, in some sense or other, a subject has difficulty bringing to explicit consciousness.  Although some externalists offer accounts of justification (see Goldman (1979) & Bergmann (2006)), this article assumes that justification is internalistic.  Externalists have a much easier time addressing concerns over foundationalism.  It is a common judgment that the foundationalist / coherentist debate takes place within the backdrop of internalism (see BonJour (1999)).

2. Arguments for Foundationalism

This section discusses prominent arguments for a general type of foundationalism.  Section 4, on varieties of foundationalism, discusses more specific arguments aimed to defend a particular species of foundationalism.

a. The Regress Argument

 

 

The epistemic regress problem has a long history.  Aristotle used the regress argument to prove that justification requires basic beliefs, beliefs that are not supported by any other beliefs but are able to support further beliefs (see Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics I.3:5-23).  The regress problem was prominent in the writings of the academic skeptics, especially Sextus Empiricus’s Outlines of Pyrrhonism and Diogenes Laertius “The Life of Pyrrho” in his book The Lives and Options of Eminent Philosophers.  In the 20th century the regress problem has received new life in the development of the coherentist and infinitist options (see BonJour (1985) and Klein (1999), respectively).

To appreciate the regress problem begin with the thought that the best way to have a good reason for some claim is to have an argument from which the claim follows.  Thus one possesses good reason to believe p when it follows from the premises q and r.  But then we must inquire about the justification for believing the premises.  Does one have a good argument for the premises?  Suppose one does.  Then we can inquire about the justification for those premises.  Does one have an argument for those claims?  If not, then it appears one lacks a good reason for the original claim because the original claim is ultimately based on claims for which no reason is offered.  If one does have an argument for those premises then either one will continue to trace out the chain of arguments to some premises for which no further reason is offered or one will trace out the chain of arguments until one loops back to the original claims or one will continue to trace out the arguments without end.  We can then begin to see the significance of the regress problem: is it arguments all the way down?  Does one eventually come back to premises that appeared in earlier arguments or does one eventually come to some ultimate premises, premises that support other claims but do not themselves require any additional support?

Skepticism aside, the options in the regress problem are known as foundationalism, coherentism, and infinitism.  Foundationalists maintain that there are some ultimate premises, premises that provide good reasons for other claims but themselves do not require additional reasons.  These ultimate premises are the proper stopping points in the regress argument.  Foundationalists hold that the other options for ending the regress are deeply problematic and that consequently there must be basic beliefs.

Coherentists and infinitists deny that there are any ultimate premises.  A simple form of coherentism holds that the arguments for any claim will eventually loop back to the original claim itself.  As long as the circle of justifications is large enough it is rationally acceptable.  After all, every claim is supported by some other claim and, arguably, the claims fit together in such a way to provide an explanation of their truth (see Lehrer (1997), Chs 1 & 2)

Infinitists think that both the foundationalist and coherentist options are epistemically objectionable.  Infinitists (as well as coherentists) claim that the foundationalist options land in arbitrary premises, premises that are alleged to support other claims but themselves lack reasons.  Against the coherentist, infinitists claim that it simply endorses circular reasoning: no matter how big the circle, circular arguments do not establish that the original claim is true.  Positively, infinitists maintain that possessing a good reason for a claim requires that it be supported by an infinite string of non-repeating reasons (see Klein (1999)).

Foundationalists use the regress argument to set up the alternative epistemological positions and then proceed to knock down these positions.  Foundationalists argue against infinitism that we never possess an infinite chain of non-repeating reasons.  At best when we consider the justification for some claim we are able to carry this justification out several steps but we never come close to anything resembling an unending chain of justifications.  For this criticism and others of infinitism see Fumerton (1998).

Against the coherentist the foundationalist agrees with the infinitist’s criticism mentioned above that circular reasoning never justifies anything.  If p is used to support q then q itself cannot be used in defense of p no matter how many intermediate steps there are between q and p.  This verdict against simple coherentism is strong, but foundationalist strategy is complicated by the fact that it is hard to find an actual coherentist who endorses circular reasoning (though see Lehrer (1997) Ch 1 and 2 for remarks about the circular nature of explanation).  Coherentists, rather, identify the assumption of linear inference in the regress argument and replace it with a stress on the holistic character of justification (see BonJour (1985)).  The assumption of linear inference in the regress argument is clearly seen above by the idea that the regress traces out arguments for some claim, where the premises of those arguments are known or justifiedly believed prior to the conclusion being known or justified believed.  The form of coherentism that rejects this assumption in the regress argument is known as holistic coherentism.

Foundationalist arguments against holistic coherentism must proceed with more care.  Because holistic coherentists disavow circular reasoning and stress the mistaken role of linear inference in the regress argument, foundationalists must supply a different argument against this option.  A standard argument against holistic coherentism is that unless the data used for coherence reasoning has some initial justification it is impossible for coherence reasoning to provide justification.  This problem affected Laurence BonJour’s attempt to defend coherentism (see BonJour (1985), pp. 102-3).  BonJour argued that coherence among one’s beliefs provided excellent reason to think that those beliefs were true.  But BonJour realized that he needed an account of how one was justified in believing that one had certain beliefs, i.e., what justified one in thinking that one did indeed hold the system of beliefs one takes oneself to believe.  BonJour quickly recognized that coherence couldn’t provide justification for this belief but it wasn’t until later in his career that he deemed this problem insuperable for a pure coherentist account (see BonJour (1997) for details).

The regress problem provides a powerful argument for foundationalism.  The regress argument, though, does not resolve particular questions about foundationalism.  The regress provides little guidance about the nature of basic beliefs or the correct theory of inferential support.  As we just observed with the discussion of holistic coherentism, considerations from the regress argument show, minimally, that the data used for coherence reasoning must have some initial presumption in its favor.  This form of foundationalism may be far from the initial hope of a rational reconstruction of common sense.  Such a reconstruction would amount to setting out in clear order the arguments for various commonsense claims (for example, I have hands, there is a material world, I have existed for more than five minutes, etc) that exhibits the ultimate basis for our view of things.  We shall consider the issues relating to varieties of foundationalists views below.

b. Natural Judgment about Cases

Another powerful consideration for foundationalism is our natural judgment about particular cases.  It seems evident that some beliefs are properly basic.  Leibniz, for instance, gives several examples of claims that don’t “involve any work of proving” and that “the mind perceives as immediately as the eye sees light” (see New Essays, IV, chapter 2, 1).  Leibniz mentions the following examples:

White is not black.

A circle is not a triangle.

Three is one and two.

Other philosophers (for example, C.I. Lewis, Roderick Chisholm, and Richard Fumerton) have found examples of such propositions in appearance states (traditionally, referred to as the given).  For instance, it may not be evident that there is a red circle before one because one may be in a misleading situation (for example, a red light shining on a white circle).  However, if one carefully considers the matter one may be convinced that something appears red.  Foundationalists stress that it is difficult to see what one could offer as a further justification for the claim about how things seem to one.  In short, truths about one’s appearance states are excellent candidates for basic beliefs.

As we shall see below a feature of this appeal to natural judgment is that it can support strong forms of foundationalism.  Richard Fumerton maintains that for some cases, for example, pain states, one’s belief can reach the highest level of philosophical assurance (see Fumerton (2006)).  Other philosophers (for example, James Pryor (2000)) maintain that some ordinary propositions, such as I have hands, are foundational.

3. Arguments Against Foundationalism

This section examines two general arguments against foundationalism.  Arguments against specific incarnations of foundationalism are considered in section 4.

a. The Problem of Arbitrariness

As noted above the regress argument figures prominently in arguing for foundationalism.  The regress argument supports the conclusion that some beliefs must be justified independently of receiving warrant from other beliefs.  However, some philosophers judge that this claim amounts to accepting some beliefs as true for no reason at all, that is, epistemically arbitrary beliefs.  This objection has significant bite against a doxastic form of foundationalism (the language of ‘doxastic’ comes from the Greek word ‘doxa’ meaning belief).  Doxastic foundationalism is the view that the justification of one’s beliefs is exclusively a matter of what other beliefs one holds.  Regarding the basic beliefs, a doxastic foundationalist holds that these beliefs are ‘self-justified’ (see Pollock & Cruz (1999), 22-23).  The content of the basic beliefs are typically perceptual reports but importantly a doxastic foundationalist does not conceive of one’s corresponding perceptual state as a reason for the belief.  Doxastic foundationalists hold that one is justified in accepting a perceptual report simply because one has the belief.  However, given the fallibility of perceptual reports, it is epistemically arbitrary to accept a perceptual report for no reason at all.

The arbitrariness objection against non-doxastic theories must proceed with more care.  A non-doxastic form of foundationalism denies that justification is exclusively a matter of relations between one’s beliefs.  Consider a non-doxastic foundationalist that attempts to stop the regress with non-doxastic states like experiences.  This foundationalist claims that, for example, the belief that there is a red disk before one is properly basic.  This belief is not justified on the basis of any other beliefs but instead justified by the character of one’s sense experience.  Because one can tell by reflection alone that one’s experience has a certain character, the experience itself provides one with an excellent reason for the belief.  The critic of non-doxastic foundationalism argues that stopping with this experience is arbitrary.  After all, there are scenarios in which this experience is misleading.  If, for example, the disk is white but illuminated with red light then one’s experience will misled one to think that the disk is really red.Unless one has a reason to think that these scenarios fail to obtain then it’s improper to stop the regress of reasons here.

One foundationalist solution to the arbitrariness problem is to move to epistemically certain foundations.  Epistemically certain foundations are beliefs that cannot be misleading and so cannot provide a foothold for arbitrariness concerns.  If, for instance, one’s experience is of a red disk and one believes just that one’s experience has this character, it is difficult to see how one’s belief could be mistaken in this specific context.   Consequently, it is hard to make sense of how one’s belief about the character of one’s experience could be epistemically arbitrary.  In general, many foundationalists want to resist this move.  First, relative to the large number of beliefs we have, there are few epistemically certain beliefs. Second, even if one locates a few epistemically certain beliefs, it is very difficult to reconstruct our common-sense view of the world from those beliefs.  If the ultimate premises of one’s view include only beliefs about the current character of one’s sense experience it’s near impossible to figure out how to justify beliefs about the external world or the past.

Another foundationalist response to the arbitrariness argument is to note that it is merely required that a properly basic belief possess some feature in virtue of which the belief is likely to be true.  It is not required that a subject believe her belief possesses that feature.  This response has the virtue of allowing for modest forms of foundationalism in which the basic beliefs are less than certain.  Critics of foundationalism continue to insist that unless the subject is aware that the belief possesses this feature, her belief is an improper stopping point in the regress of reasons.  For a defense of the arbitrariness objection against foundationalism see Klein (1999) & (2004), and for responses to Klein see Bergmann (2004), Howard-Snyder & Coffman (2006), Howard-Snyder (2005), and Huemer (2003).

b. The Sellarsian Dilemma

The Sellarsian dilemma was first formulated in Wilfrid Sellars’s rich, but difficult, essay “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind.”  Sellars’s main goal in this essay is to undermine the entire framework of givenness ((1963), p. 128).  Talk of ‘the given’ was prevalent in earlier forms of foundationalism (see, for example, C.I. Lewis (1929), Ch 2).  The phrase ‘the given’ refers to elements of experience that are putatively immediately known in experience.  For instance, if one looks at a verdant golf course the sensation green is alleged to be given in experience. In a Cartesian moment one may doubt whether or not one is actually perceiving a golf course but, the claim is, one cannot rationally doubt that there is a green sensation present. Strong foundationalists appeal to the given to ground empirical knowledge.  In “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind” Sellars argues that the idea of the given is a myth.

The details of Sellars’ actual argument are difficult to decipher.  The most promising reconstruction of Sellars’ argument occurs in chapter 4 of BonJour’s (1985).  BonJour formulates the dilemma using the notion of ‘assertive representational content’.  Representational content is the kind of content possessed by beliefs, hopes, and fears.  A belief, a hope, or a fear could be about the same thing; one could believe that it is raining, hope that it is raining, or fear that it is raining.  These states all have in common the same representational contentAssertive representational content is content that is presented as being true but may, in fact, be false.  A good case of assertive content comes from the Müller-Lyer illusion.  In this well-known experiment a subject experiences two vertical lines as being unequal in length even though they have the same length.  The subject’s experience presents as true the content that these lines are unequal.

Given the notion of assertive representational content BonJour reformulates the Sellarsian dilemma: either experience has assertive representational content or not.  If experience has assertive representational content then one needs an additional reason to think that the content is correct.  If, however, experience lacks this content then experience cannot provide a reason for thinking that some proposition is true.  The dilemma focuses on non-doxastic foundationalism and is used to argue that anyway the view is filled out, it cannot make good on the intuition that experience is a proper foundation for justification.

Let us examine each option of the dilemma staring with the second option.  A defense of this option observes that it is difficult to understand how experience could provide a good reason for believing some claim if it failed to have representational content.  Think of the olfactory experience associated with a field of flowers in full bloom.  Apart from a formed association between that experience and its cause, it is difficult to understand how that experience has representational content.  In other words, the experience lacks any content; it makes no claim that the world is one way rather than another.  However, if that is right, how could that experience provide any reason for believing that the world is one way rather than another?  If the experience itself is purely qualitative then it cannot provide a reason to believe that some proposition is true.  In short, there is a strong judgment that apart from the representational content of experience, experience is powerless to provide reasons.

A defense of the first option of the dilemma takes us back to issues raised by the arbitrariness objection.  If experience does have assertive representational content then that content can be true or false.  If the content is possibly false, the experience is not a proper stopping point in the regress of reasons.  The whole idea behind the appeal to the given was to stop the regress of reasons in a state that did not require further justification because it was not the sort of thing that needed justification.  If experience, like belief, has representational content then there is no good reason to stop the regress of reasons with experience rather than belief.  In brief, if experience functions as a reason in virtue of its assertive representational content then there is nothing special about experience as opposed to belief in its ability to provide reasons.  Since the arbitrariness objection shows that belief is not a proper stopping point in the regress, the Sellarsian dilemma shows that experience is not a proper stopping point either.

Probably the best foundationalist response to the Sellarsian dilemma is to argue that the first option of the dilemma is mistaken; experience has assertive propositional content and can still provide a regress stopping reason to believe that some claim is true.  There are broadly two kinds of responses here depending on whether one thinks that the content of experience could be false.  On one view, experience carries a content that may be false but that this experiential content provides a basic reason for thinking that this content is true.  For instance, it may perceptually seem to one that there is a coffee mug on the right corner of the desk.  This content may be false but in virtue of its being presented as true in experience one has a basic reason for thinking that it is true (see Pryor (2000) & Huemer (2001) for developments of this view).  The other view one might take is that experiential content—at least the kind that provides a basic reason—cannot be false.  One this view the kind of content that experience provides for a basic reason is something like this: it perceptually seems that there is a red disk before me.  Laurence BonJour (in BonJour & Sosa (2003)) develops a view like this.  On his view, one has a built-in constitutive awareness of experiential content, and in virtue of that awareness of content one has a basic reason to believe that the content is true.   For a good criticism of BonJour’s strategy, see Bergmann (2006), Chapter 2.  For a different, externalist response to the dilemma see Jack Lyons (2008).

See the Encyclopedia article "Coherentism" for more criticism of foundationalism.

4. Types of Foundationalist Views

This section surveys varieties of foundationalist views.  As remarked above foundationalists have two main projects: providing a suitable theory of noninferential justification and providing an adequate theory of proper inference.  We will examine three views on non-inferential justification and three views on inferential justification.

a. Theories of Noninferential Justification

An adequate theory of noninferential justification is essential for foundationalism.  Foundationalist views differ on the nature of noninferential justification.  We can distinguish three types of foundationalist views corresponding to the strength of justification possessed by the basic beliefs: strong, modest, and weak foundationalism.  In the following we shall examine these three views and the arguments for and against them.

i. Strong Foundationalism

Strong foundationalists hold that the properly basic beliefs are epistemically exalted in some interesting sense.  In addition to basic beliefs possessing the kind of justification necessary for knowledge (let us refer to this as “knowledge level justification”) strong foundationalists claim the properly basic beliefs are infallible, indubitable, or incorrigible.  Infallible beliefs are not possibly false.  Indubitable beliefs are not possible to doubt even though the content may be false, and incorrigible beliefs cannot be undermined by further information.  The focus on these exalted epistemic properties grows out of Descartes’ method of doubt.  Descartes aimed to locate secure foundations for knowledge and dismissed any claims that were fallible, dubitable, or corrigible.  Thus, Descartes sought the foundations of knowledge in restricted mental states like I am thinking.  Before we examine arguments against strong foundationalism let us investigate some arguments in favor of it.

Probably the most widespread argument for strong foundationalism is the need for philosophical assurance concerning the truth of one’s beliefs (see Fumerton (2006)).  If one adopts the philosophical undertaking to trace out the ultimate reasons for one’s view it can seem particularly remiss to stop this philosophical quest with fallible, dubitable, or corrigible reasons.  As Descartes realized if the possibility that one is dreaming is compatible with one’s evidence then that evidence is not an adequate ground for a philosophical satisfying reconstruction of knowledge.  Consequently, if a philosophically satisfying perspective of knowledge is to be found it will be located in foundations that are immune from doubt.

Another argument for strong foundationalism is C.I. Lewis’s contention that probability must be grounded in certainty (see Lewis (1952); also see Pastin (1975a) for a response to Lewis’s argument).  Lewis’s argument appeals explicitly to the probability calculus but we can restate the driving intuition apart from utilizing any formal machinery. Lewis reasoned that if a claim is uncertain then it is rationally acceptable only given further information.  If that further information is uncertain then it is acceptable only given additional information.  If this regress continues without ever coming to a certainty then Lewis conjectures that the original claim is not rationally acceptable.

We can get a sense of Lewis’s intuition by considering a conspiracy theorist that has a defense for every claim in his convoluted chain of reasoning.  We might think that, in general, the theorist is right about the conditional claims—if this is true then that is probably correct—but just plain wrong that the entire chain of arguments supports the conspiracy theory.  We correctly realize that the longer the chain of reasoning the less likely the conclusion is true.  The chance of error grows with the amount of information.  Lewis’s argument takes this intuition to its limit: unless uncertainties are grounded in certainties no claim is ever rationally acceptable.

Let us examine several arguments against strong foundationalism.  The most repeated argument against strong foundationalism is that its foundations are inadequate for a philosophical reconstruction of knowledge.  We take ourselves to know much about the world around us from mundane facts about our immediate surroundings to more exotic facts about the far reaches of the universe.  Yet if the basic material for this reconstruction is restricted to facts about an individual’s own mind it is nearly impossible to figure out how we can get back to our ordinary picture of the world.  In this connection strong foundationalists face an inherent tension between the quest for epistemic security and the hope for suitable content to reconstruct commonsense.  Few strong foundationalists have been able to find a suitable balance between these competing demands.  Some philosophers with a more metaphysical bent aimed to reduce each statement about the material world to a logical construction of statements about an individual’s own sense experience.  This project is known as phenomenalism.  The phenomenalist’ guiding idea was that statements about the physical world were really complex statements about sensations.  If this guiding idea could be worked out then strong foundationalist would have a clear conception of how the “commonsense” picture of the world could be justified.  However, this guiding idea could never be worked out.  See, for instance, Roderick Chisholm’s (1948) article.

Another argument against strong foundationalism is David Armstrong’s ‘distinct existence’ argument ((1968), 106-7).  Armstrong argues that there is a difference between an awareness of X and X, where X is some mental state.  For instance, there is a difference between being in pain and awareness of being in pain.  As long as awareness of X is distinct from X, Armstrong argues that it is possible for one to seemingly be aware of X without X actually occurring.  For instance, an intense pain that gradually fades away can lead to a moment in which one has a false awareness of being in pain.  Consequently, the thought that one can enjoy an infallible awareness of some mental state is mistaken.

A recent argument against strong foundationalism is Timothy Williamson’s anti-luminosity argument (see Williamson (2000)).  Williamson does not talk about foundationalism but talks rather in terms of the ongoing temptation in philosophy to postulate a realm of luminous truths, truths that shine so brightly they are always open to our view if we carefully consider the matter.  Even though Williamson doesn’t mention foundationalism his argument clearly applies to the strong foundationalist.  Williamson’s actual argument is intricate and we cannot go into it in much detail.  The basic idea behind Williamson’s argument is that appearance states (for example, it seems as if there is a red item before you) permit of a range of similar cases.  Think of color samples.  There is a string of color samples from red to orange in which each shade is very similar to the next.  If appearance states genuinely provided certainty, indubitability, or the like then one should be able to always tell what state one was in.  But there are cases that are so similar that one might make a mistake.  Thus, because of the fact that appearance states ebb and flow, they cannot provide certainty, indubitability or the like.  There is a burgeoning discussion of the anti-luminosity argument; see Fumerton (2009) for a strong foundationalist response and Meeker & Poston (2010) for a recent discussion and references).

ii. Modest Foundationalism

Prior to 1975 foundationalism was largely identified with strong foundationalism.  Critics of foundationalism attacked the claims that basic beliefs are infallible, incorrigible, or indubitable.  However, around this time there was a growing recognition that foundationalism was compatible with basic beliefs that lacked these epistemically exalted properties.  William Alston (1976a; 1976b), C.F. Delaney (1976), and Mark Pastin (1975a; 1975b) all argued that a foundationalist epistemology merely required that the basic beliefs have a level of positive epistemic status independent of warranting relations from other beliefs. In light of this weaker form of foundationalism the attacks against infallibility, incorrigibility, or indubitability did not touch the core of a foundationalist epistemology.

William Alston probably did the most to rehabilitate foundationalism.  Alston provides several interrelated distinctions that illustrate the limited appeal of certain arguments against strong foundationalism and also displays the attractiveness of modest foundationalism.  The first distinction Alston drew was between epistemic beliefs and non-epistemic beliefs (see 1976a).  Epistemic beliefs are beliefs whose content contains an epistemic concept such as knowledge or justification, whereas a non-epistemic belief does not contain an epistemic concept.  The belief that there is a red circle before me is not an epistemic belief because its content does not contain any epistemic concepts.  However, the belief that I am justified in believing that there is a red, circle before me is an epistemic belief on account of the epistemic concept justified figuring in its content.   Alston observes that prominent arguments against foundationalism tend to run together these two beliefs.  For instance, an argument against foundationalism might require that to be justified in believing that p one must justifiedly believe that I am justified in believing that p.  That is, the argument against foundationalism assumes that epistemic beliefs are required for the justification of non-epistemic beliefs.  As Alston sees it, once these two types of belief are clearly separated we should be suspicious of any such argument that requires epistemic beliefs for the justification of non-epistemic beliefs (for details see (1976a) and (1976b)).

A closely related distinction for Alston is the distinction between the state of being justified and the activity of exhibiting one’s justification.  Alston argues in a like manner that prominent objections to foundationalism conflate these two notions.  The state of being justified does not imply that one can exhibit one’s justification.  Reflection on actual examples support Alston’s claim.  Grandma may be justified in believing that she has hands without being in a position to exhibit her justification.  Timmy is justified in believing that he has existed for more than five minutes but he can do very little to demonstrate his justification.  Therefore, arguments against foundationalism should not assume that justification requires the ability to exhibit one’s justification.

A final, closely allied, distinction is between a justification regress argument and a showing regress argument.  Alston argues that the standard regress argument is a regress of justification that points to the necessity of immediately justified beliefs.  This argument is distinct from a showing regress in which the aim is to demonstrate that one is justified in believing p.  This showing regress requires that one proves that one is justified in believing p for each belief one has.  Given Alston’s earlier distinctions this implies that one must have epistemic beliefs for each non-epistemic belief and further it conflates the distinction between the state of being justified and the activity of exhibiting one’s justification.

With these three distinctions in place and the further claim that immediately justified beliefs may be fallible, revisable, and dubitable Alston makes quick work of the standard objections to strong foundationalism.  The arguments against strong foundationalism fail to apply to modest foundationalism and further have no force against the claim that some beliefs have a strong presumption of truth.  Reflection on actual cases supports Alston’s claim.  Grandma’s belief that she has hands might be false and revised in light of future evidence.  Perhaps, Grandma has been fitted with a prosthetic device that looks and functions just like a normal hand.  Nonetheless when she looks and appears to see a hand, she is fully justified in believing that she has hands.

Alston’s discussion of modest foundationalism does not mention weaker forms of foundationalism.  Further Alston is not clear on the precise epistemic status on these foundations.  Alston describes the ‘minimal’ form of foundationalism as simply being committed to non-inferentially justified beliefs.  However, as we shall shortly see BonJour identifies a modest and weak form of foundationalism.  For purposes of terminological regimentation we shall take ‘modest’ foundationalism to be the claim that the basic beliefs possess knowledge adequate justification even though these beliefs may be fallible, corrigible, or dubitable.  A corollary to modest foundationalism is the thesis that the basic beliefs can serve as premises for additional beliefs.  The picture then the modest foundationalist offers us is that of knowledge (and justification) as resting on a foundation of propositions whose positive epistemic status is sufficient to infer other beliefs but whose positive status may be undermined by further information.

A significant development in modest foundationalism is the rise of reformed epistemology.  Reformed epistemology is a view in the epistemology of religious belief, which holds that the belief that there is a God can be properly basic.  Alvin Plantinga (1983) develops this view.  Plantinga holds that an individual may rationally believe that there is a God even though the individual does not possess sufficient evidence to convince an agnostic.  Furthermore, the individual need not know how to respond to various objections to theism.  On Plantinga’s view as long as the belief is produced in the right way it is justified.  Plantinga has developed reformed epistemology in his (2000) volume.  Plantinga develops the view as a form of externalism that holds that the justification conferring factors for a belief may include external factors.

Modest foundationalism is not without its critics.  Some strong foundationalists argue that modest foundationalism is too modest to provide adequate foundations for empirical knowledge (see McGrew (2003)).  Timothy McGrew argues that empirical knowledge must be grounded in certainties.  McGrew deploys an argument similar to C.I. Lewis’s argument that probabilities require certainties.  McGrew argues that every statement that has less than unit probability is grounded in some other statement.  If the probability that it will rain today is .9 then there must be some additional information that one is taking in account to get this probability.  Consequently, if the alleged foundations are merely probable then they are really no foundations at all.  Modest foundationalists disagree.  They hold that some statements may have an intrinsic non-zero probability (see for instance Mark Pastin’s response to C.I. Lewis’s argument in Pastin (1975a)).

iii. Weak Foundationalism

Weak foundationalism is an interesting form of foundationalism.  Laurence BonJour mentions the view as a possible foundationalist view in his (1985) book The Structure of Empirical Knowledge.  According to BonJour the weak foundationalist holds that some non-inferential beliefs are minimally justified, where this justification is not strong enough to satisfy the justification condition on knowledge.  Further this justification is not strong enough to allow the individual beliefs to serve as premises to justify other beliefs (see BonJour (1985), 30).  However, because knowledge and inference are fundamental features to our epistemic practices, a natural corollary to weak foundationalism is that coherence among one’s beliefs is required for knowledge-adequate justification and also for one’s beliefs to function as premises for other beliefs.  Thus for the weak foundationalist, coherence has an ineliminable role for knowledge and inference. 

This form of foundationalism is a significant departure from the natural stress foundationalists place on the regress argument.  Attention on the regress argument focuses one back to the ultimate beliefs of one’s view.  If these beliefs are insufficient to license inference to other beliefs it is difficult to make good sense of a reconstruction of knowledge.  At the very least the reconstruction will not proceed in a step by step manner in which one begins with a limited class of beliefs—the basic ones—and then moves to the non-basic ones.  If, in addition, coherence is required for the basic beliefs to serve as premises for other beliefs then this form of weak foundationalism looks very similar to refined forms of coherentism.

Some modest foundationalists maintain that weak foundationalism is inadequate.  James Van Cleve contends that weak foundationalism is inadequate to generate justification for one’s beliefs (van Cleve (2005)).  Van Cleve presents two arguments for the claim that some beliefs must have a high intrinsic credibility (pp. 173-4).  First, while coherence can increase the justification for thinking that one’s ostensible recollections are correct, one must have significant justification for thinking that one has correctly identified one’s ostensible recollection.  That is to say, one must have more than weak justification for thinking one’s apparent memory does report that p, whether or not this apparent memory is true.  Apart from the thought that one has strong justification for believing that one’s ostensible memory is as one takes it to be, Van Cleve argues it is difficult to see how coherence could increase the justification for believing that those apparent memories are true.

The second argument Van Cleve offers comes from Bertrand Russell ((1948), p. 188).  Russell observes that one fact makes another probable or improbable only in relation to a law.  Therefore, for coherence among certain facts, to make another fact probable one must have sufficient justification for believing a law that connects the facts.  Van Cleve explains that we might not require a genuine law but rather an empirical generalization that connects the two facts.  Nonetheless Russell’s point is that for coherence to increase the probability of some claim we must have more than weak justification for believing some generalization.  The problem for the weak foundationalist is that our justification for believing an empirical generalization depends on memory.  Consequently, memory must supply the needed premise in a coherence argument and it can do this only if memory supplies more than weak justification.  In short, the coherence among ostensible memories increases justification only if we have more than weak justification for believing some generalization provided by memory.

b. Theories of Proper Inference

Much of the attention on foundationalism has focused on the nature and existence of basic beliefs.  Yet a crucial element of foundationalism is the nature of the inferential relations between basic beliefs and non-basic beliefs.  Foundationalists claim that all of one’s non-basic beliefs are justified ultimately by the basic beliefs, but how is this supposed to work?  What are the proper conditions for the justification of the non-basic beliefs?  The following discusses three approaches to inferential justification: deductivism, strict inductivism, and liberal inductivism.

i. Deductivism

Deductivists hold that proper philosophical method consists in the construction of deductively valid arguments whose premises are indubitable or self-evident (see remarks by Nozick (1981) and Lycan (1988)).  Deductivists travel down the regress in order to locate the epistemic atoms from which they attempt to reconstruct the rest of one’s knowledge by deductive inference.  Descartes’ epistemology is often aligned with deductivism.  Descartes locates the epistemically basic beliefs in beliefs about the ideas in one’s mind and then deduces from those ideas that a good God exists.  Then given that a good God exists, Descartes deduces further that the ideas in his mind must correspond to objects in reality.  Therefore, by a careful deductive method, Descartes aims to reconstruct our knowledge of the external world.

Another prominent example of deductivism comes from phenomenalism.  As mentioned earlier, phenomenalism is the attempt to analyze statements about physical objects in terms of statements about patterns of sense data.  Given this analysis, the phenomenalist can deduce our knowledge of the external world from knowledge of our own sensory states.  Whereas Descartes’ deductivism took a theological route through the existence of a good God, the phenomenalist eschews theology and attempts a deductive reconstruction by a metaphysical analysis of statements about the external world.  Though this project is a momentous failure, it illustrates a tendency in philosophy to grasp for certainty.

Contemporary philosophers dismiss deductivism as implausible.  Deductivism requires strong foundationalism because the ultimate premises must be infallible, indubitable, or incorrigible.  However, many philosophers judge that the regress stopping premises need not have these exalted properties. Surely, the thought continues, we know things like I have hands and the world has existed for more than five minutes? Additionally, if one restricts proper inference to deduction then one can never expand upon the information contained in the premises.  Deductive inference traces out logical implications of the information contained in the premises.  So if the basic premises are limited to facts about one’s sensory states then one can’t go ‘beyond’ those states to facts about the external world, the past, or the future.  To accommodate that knowledge we must expand either our premises or our conception of inference.  Either direction abandons the deductivist picture of proper philosophical method.

ii. Strict Inductivism

One response to the above challenge for deductivism is to move to modest foundationalism, which allows the basic premises to include beliefs about the external world or the past.  However, even this move is inadequate to account for all our knowledge.  In addition to knowing particular facts about the external world or the past we know some general truths about the world such as all crows are black.  It is implausible that this belief is properly basic.  Further, the belief that every observed and unobserved crow is black is not implied by any properly basic belief such as this crow is black.  In addition to moving away from a strong foundationalist theory of non-inferential justification, one must abandon deductivism.

To accommodate knowledge of general truths, philosophers must allow for other kinds of inference beside deductive inference.  The standard form of non-deductive inference is enumerative induction.  Enumerative induction works by listing (that is, enumerating) all the relevant instances and then concluding on the basis of a sufficient sample that all the relevant instances have the target property.  Suppose, for instance, one knows that 100 widgets from the Kenosha Widget Factory have a small k printed on it and that one knows of no counterexamples to this.  Given this knowledge, one can infer by enumerative induction that every widget from the Kenosha Widget Factory has a small k printed on it. Significantly, this inference is liable to mislead.  Perhaps, the widgets one has examined are special in some way that is relevant to the small printed k.  For example, the widgets come from an exclusive series of widgets to celebrate the Kafka’s birthday.  Even though the inference may mislead, it is still intuitively a good inference.  Given a sufficient sample size and no counterexamples, one may infer that the sample is representative of the whole.

The importance of enumerative induction is that it allows one to expand one’s knowledge of the world beyond the foundations.  Moreover, enumerative induction is a form of linear inference.  The premises of the induction are known or justifiedly believed prior to the conclusion being justified believed.  This suggests that enumerative induction is a natural development of the foundationalist conception of knowledge.  Knowledge rests on properly basic beliefs and those other beliefs that can be properly inferred from the best beliefs by deduction and enumerative induction.

iii. Liberal Inductivism

Strict inductivism is motivated by the thought that we have some kind of inferential knowledge of the world that cannot be accommodated by deductive inference from epistemically basic beliefs.  A fairly recent debate has arisen over the merits of strict inductivism.  Some philosophers have argued that there are other forms of non-deductive inference that do not fit the model of enumerative induction.  C.S. Peirce describes a form of inference called “abduction” or “inference to the best explanation.”  This form of inference appeals to explanatory considerations to justify belief.  One infers, for example, that two students copied answers from a third because this is the best explanation of the available data—they each make the same mistakes and the two sat in view of the third.  Alternatively, in a more theoretical context, one infers that there are very small unobservable particles because this is the best explanation of Brownian motion.  Let us call ‘liberal inductivism’ any view that accepts the legitimacy of a form of inference to the best explanation that is distinct from enumerative induction.  For a defense of liberal inductivism see Gilbert Harman’s classic (1965) paper.  Harman defends a strong version of liberal inductivism according to which enumerative induction is just a disguised from of inference to the best explanation.

A crucial task for liberal inductivists is to clarify the criteria that are used to evaluate explanations.  What makes one hypothesis a better explanation than another?  A standard answer is that hypotheses are rated as to their simplicity, testability, scope, fruitfulness, and conservativeness.  The simplicity of a hypothesis is a matter of how many entities, properties, or laws it postulates.  The theory that the streets are wet because it rained last night is simpler than the theory that the streets are wet because there was a massive water balloon fight between the septuagenarians and octogenarians last night.  A hypothesis’s testability is a matter of its ability to be determined to be true or false.  Some hypotheses are more favorable because they can easily be put to the test and when they survive the test, they receive confirmation.  The scope of a hypothesis is a matter of how much data the hypothesis covers.  If two competing hypotheses both entail the fall of the American dollar but another also entails the fact that the Yen rose, the hypothesis that explains this other fact has greater scope.  The fruitfulness of a hypothesis is a matter of how well it can be implemented for new research projects.  Darwin’s theory on the origin of the species has tremendous fruitfulness because, for one, it opened up the study of molecular genetics.  Finally, the conservativeness of a hypothesis is a matter of its fit with our previously accepted theories and beliefs.

The liberal inductivist points to the alleged fact that many of our commonsense judgments about what exists are guided by inference to the best explanation.  If, for instance, we hear the scratching in the walls and witness the disappearance of cheese, we infer that there are mice in the wainscoting.  As the liberal inductivist sees it, this amounts to a primitive use of inference to the best explanation.  The mice hypothesis is relatively simple, testable, and conservative.

The epistemological payout for accepting the legitimacy of inference to the best explanation is significant.  This form of inference is ideally suited for dealing with under-determination cases, cases in which one’s evidence for a hypothesis is compatible with its falsity.  For instance, the evidence we possess for believing that the story of general relativity is correct is compatible with the falsity of that theory.  Nonetheless, we judge that we are rational in believing that general relativity is true based on the available evidence.  The theory of general relativity is the best available explanation of the data.  Similarly, epistemological under-determination arguments focus on the fact that the perceptual data we possess is compatible with the falsity of our common sense beliefs.  If a brain in the vat scenario obtained then one would have all the same sensation states and still believe that, for example, one was seated at a desk.  Nevertheless, the truth of our commonsense beliefs is the best available explanation for the data of sense.  Therefore, our commonsense beliefs meet the justification condition for knowledge.  See Jonathan Vogel (1990) for a response to skepticism along these lines and see Richard Fumerton (1992) for a contrasting perspective.

Liberal inductivism is not without its detractors. Richard Fumerton argues that every acceptable inductive inference is either a straightforward case of induction or a combination of straightforward induction and deduction. Fumerton focuses on paradigm cases of alleged inference to the best explanation and argues that these cases are enthymemes (that is, arguments with suppressed premises).  He considers a case in which someone infers that a person walked recently on the beach from the evidence that there are footprints on the beach and that if a person walked recently on the beach there would be footprints on the beach.  Fumerton observes that this inference fits in to the standard pattern of inference to the best explanation.  However, he then argues that the acceptability of this inference depends on our justification for believing that in the vast majority of cases footprints are produced by people.  Fumerton thus claims that this paradigmatic case of inference to the best explanation is really a disguised form of inference to a particular: the vast majority of footprints are produced by persons; there are footprints on the beach; therefore, a person walked on the beach recently.  The debate of the nature and legitimacy of inference to the best explanation is an active and exciting area of research.  For an excellent discussion and defense of inference to the best explanation see Lipton (2004).

iv. A Theory of Inference and A Theory of Concepts

There are non-trivial connections between a foundationalist theory of inference and theory of concepts.  This is one of the points at which epistemology meets the philosophy of mind.  Both deductivists and strict inductivists tend to accept a thesis about the origin of our concepts.  They both tend to accept the thesis of concept empiricism in which all of our concepts derive from experience.  Following Locke and Hume, concept empiricists stress that we cannot make sense of any ideas that are not based in experience.  Some concept empiricists are strong foundationalists in which case they work with a very limited range of sensory concepts (for example, C.I. Lewis) or they are modest foundationalist in which they take concepts of the external world as disclosed in experience (that is, direct realists).  Concept empiricists are opposed to inference to the best explanation because a characteristic feature of inference to the best explanation is inference to an unobservable.  As the concept empiricist sees it this is illegitimate because we lack the ability to think of genuine non-observables.  For a sophisticated development of this view see Van Fraassen (1980).

Concept rationalists, by contrast, allow that we possess concepts that are not disclosed in experience.  Some concept rationalists, like Descartes, held that some concepts are innate such as the concepts God, substance, or I.  Other concept rationalists view inference to the best explanation as a way of forming new concepts.  In general concept rationalists do not limit the legitimate forms of inference to deduction and enumerative induction.  For a discussion of concept empiricism and rationalism in connection with foundationalism see Timothy McGrew (2003).

5. Conclusion

 

Foundationalism is a multifaceted doctrine.  A well-worked out foundationalist view needs to naturally combine a theory of non-inferential justification with a view of the nature of inference.  The nature and legitimacy of non-deductive inference is a relatively recent topic and there is hope that significant progress will be made on this score.  Moreover, given the continued interest in the regress problem foundationalism provides to be of perennial interest.  The issues that drive research on foundationalism are fundamental epistemic questions about the structure and legitimacy of our view of the world.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W. 1976a.  “Two Types of Foundationalism.” The Journal of Philosophy 73, 165-185.
  • Alston, W. 1976b.  “Has foundationalism been refuted?” Philosophical Studies 29, 287-305.
  • Armstrong, D.M. 1968. A Materialist Theory of Mind.  New York: Routledge.
  • Audi, R.  The Structure of Justification.  New York: Cambridge.
  • Bergmann, Michael. 2004.  “What’s not wrong with foundationalism,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXVIII, 161-165.
  • Bergmann, Michael. 2006. Justification without Awareness.  New York: Oxford.
  • BonJour, L. 1985.  The Structure of Empirical Knowledge.  Cambridge, MA. Harvard University Press.
  • BonJour, L.  1997.  “Haack on Experience and Justification.”  Synthese 112:1, 13-23.
  • BonJour, L. 1999.  “The Dialectic of Foundationalism and Coherentism.” In The Blackwell Guide to Epistemology eds. John Greco and Ernest Sosa.  Malden, MA: Blackwell, 117-142.
  • BonJour, L and Sosa, E. 2003.  Epistemic Justification: Internalism vs. Externalism, Foundations vs. Virtues. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • Chisholm, R. 1948. “The Problem of Empiricism,” The Journal of Philosophy 45, 512-517.
  • Delaney, C.F. 1976. “Foundations of Empirical Knowledge – Again,” New Scholasticism L, 1-19.
  • Fumerton, R. 1980.  “Induction and Reasoning to the Best Explanation.”  Philosophy of Science 47, 589-600.
  • Fumerton, R. 1992.  “Skepticism and Reasoning to the Best Explanation.”  Philosophical Issues 2, 149-169.
  • Fumerton, R. 1998.  “Replies to My Three Critics.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58, 927-937.
  • Fumerton, R.  2006. “Epistemic Internalism, Philosophical Assurance and the Skeptical Predicament,” in Knowledge and Reality, eds. Crisp, Davidson, and Laan. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 179-191.
  • Fumerton, R. 2009. “Luminous enough for a cognitive home.”  Philosophical Studies 142, 67-76.
  • Goldman, A. 1979.  “What is Justified Belief?” in Justification and knowledge. Eds.  George Pappas.  Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1-23.
  • Haack, S. 1993.  Evidence and Inquiry: Towards Reconstruction in Epistemology. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1965. “Inference to the Best Explanation.”  The Philosophical Review 74, 88-95.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel. 2005.  “Foundationalism and Arbitrariness,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 86, 18-24.
  • Howard-Snyder, D & Coffman, E.J. 2006 “Three Arguments Against Foundationalism: Arbitrariness, Epistemic Regress, and Existential Support,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 36:4, 535-564.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2003.  “Arbitrary Foundations?” The Philosophical Forum XXXIV, 141-152.
  • Klein, Peter.  1999.  “Human knowledge and the regress of reasons,” Philosophical Perspectives 13, 297-325.
  • Klein, Peter. 2004. “What is wrong with foundationalism is that it cannot solve the epistemic regress problem,”  Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXVIII, 166-171.
  • Lehrer, K. 1997.  Self-Trust.  New York: Oxford.
  • Lewis, C.I. 1929.  Mind and the World Order.  New York: Dover Publications.
  • Lewis, C.I.  1952.  “The Given Element in Empirical Knowledge.” The Philosophical Review 61, 168-175.
  • Lipton, P. 2004.  Inference to the Best Explanation 2nd edition.  New York: Routledge.
  • Lycan, W. 1988.  Judgment and Justification.  New York: Cambridge.
  • Lyons, J. 2008.  “Evidence, Experience, and Externalism,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 86, 461-479
  • McGrew, T. 2003. “A Defense of Classical Foundationalism,” in The Theory of Knowledge, ed. Louis Pojman, Belmont: CA. Wadsworth, pp. 194-206.
  • Meeker, K & Poston, T.  2010.  “Skeptics without Borders.”  American Philosophical Quarterly 47:3, 223-237.
  • Neurath, Otto.  1959.  “Protocol Sentences.” In Logical Positivism ed. A.J. Ayer Free Press, New York, 199-208.
  • Nozick, R. 1981.  Philosophical Explanations.  Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Pastin, M. 1975a. “C.I. Lewis’s Radical Foundationalism” Nous 9, 407-420.
  • Pastin, M. 1975b. “Modest Foundationalism and Self-Warrant,” American Philosophical Quarterly 4, 141-149.
  • Plantinga, A. 1983.  “Reason and Belief in God,” in Faith and Rationality. Eds. Alvin Plantinga and Nicholas Wolterstorff.  Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Plantinga, A. 1993.  Warrant: The Current Debate.  New York: Oxford.
  • Plantinga, A. 2000.  Warranted Christian Belief.  New York: Oxford.
  • Pollock, J and Cruz, J. 1999.  Contemporary Theories of Knowledge 2nd edition.  New York: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Pryor, J. 2000.  “The Skeptic and the Dogmatist.”  Nous 34, 517-549.
  • Pryor, J. 2001. “Highlights of Recent Epistemology,” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 52, 95-124.
    • Stresses that modest foundationalism looks better in 2001 than it looked circa 1976.
  • Quine. W.V.O.  1951. “Two Dogmas of Empiricism.”  The Philosophical Review 60, 20-43.
  • Rescher, N. 1973.  The Coherence Theory of Truth.  New York: Oxford.
  • Russell, B. 1948.  Human Knowledge.  New York: Routledge.
  • Schlick, Moritz. 1959.  “The Foundation of Knowledge.” In Logical Positivism ed. A.J. Ayer Free Press, New York, 209-227.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1963.  “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind,” in Science, Perception, and Reality.  Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Co, pp. 127-196.
  • Triplett, Timm. 1990. “Recent work on Foundationalism,” American Philosophical Quarterly 27:2, 93-116.
  • van Cleve, James. 2005.  "Why Coherence is Not Enough:  A Defense of Moderate Foundationalism,” in Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, edited by Matthias Steup and Ernest Sosa. Oxford:  Blackwell, pp. 168-80.
  • van Fraassen, Bas. 1980.  The Scientific Image.  New York: Oxford.
  • Vogel, Jonathan. 1990.  “Cartesian Skepticism and Inference to the Best Explanation.”  The Journal of Philosophy 87, 658-666.

Author Information

Ted Poston
Email: poston “at” jaguar1.usouthal.edu
University of South Alabama
U. S. A.

Benedict de Spinoza: Epistemology

spinozaThe theory of knowledge, or epistemology, offered by the 17th century Dutch philosopher Benedict de Spinoza may yet prove to be the most daring in the history of philosophy. Not only does Spinoza claim to be able to know all the ways one can know something, he also claims to be able to know what everything is. Few philosophers besides Spinoza have sought and proclaimed possession of absolute knowledge quite like he had. Of the philosophers who have claimed absolute knowledge, only Spinoza has offered it, not as the reception of a divine revelation, and not as the fulfillment of a historical process, as in Hegel's epistemology, but as a means for intuitively affirming the truth inherent within all of reality. Reality is susceptible to such an intuition, he said, because every being is a mode of it, or a way that it expresses itself. In other words, for us to come to know the "absolute" is for the absolute to come to know itself. There is thus something basically self-reflexive and introspective about Spinoza’s epistemology. At the same time, knowledge for Spinoza is always of what he calls God or Nature, which can also be understood as the universe itself.

However, whether or not Spinoza’s epistemology is valid by any standard besides his own, remains a point of contention. Most philosophers believe that Spinoza’s epistemology wildly oversteps the limits of human finitude, while others believe that even if Spinoza certainly experienced something within himself that he called "the truth," we have no real access to it ourselves. This article explores the role and function of knowledge in Spinoza’s philosophy as a whole and the methodology he uses to know things and to know knowledge. The article closely follows Spinoza’s threefold division of the different types of knowledge as  presented in his Ethics. This threefold division is constituted by the distinctions among imagination, intuition, and the exercise of the intellect.

Table of Contents

  1. The Role of Knowledge in Spinoza’s Philosophy
    1. Why Search for Knowledge?
    2. Knowledge in the Ethics
  2. Spinoza’s Method for Epistemology
    1. The Geometric Method
    2. The Sub Specie Model, or Perspectivism
  3. The First Kind of Knowledge
    1. Imagination
    2. Prejudice and Superstition
    3. Miracles, Prophecy, and Revelation
  4. The Second Kind of Knowledge
    1. Intellection
    2. Common Notions
    3. Reason
  5. The Third Kind of Knowledge
    1. Intuition
    2. Love and Blessedness
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Role of Knowledge in Spinoza’s Philosophy

 

Spinoza’s philosophy as a whole can be seen as continuous reflection on the role and function of knowledge itself. As a rationalist, along with Descartes and Leibniz, he was concerned with improving the power of the intellect, with its inherent capacity to reason, so that it could overcome the obscurity and confusion of our everyday perceptions. Spinoza’s first attempt at writing philosophy was a treatise intended to teach us how to best utilize our natural, rational powers so as to overcome our enslavement to the partial knowledge supplied by the senses. This work was the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect (TdIE). Spinoza wrote this work, it is believed, in the early 1660s, but he never finished it. In the treatise, Spinoza begins with an autobiographical moment that explains to the reader why he wanted to improve or emend the intellect.

1a. Why Search for Knowledge?

 

Spinoza sees the obtaining of true knowledge to be the sole avenue for liberating oneself from the limits and fallibility of an average human existence. Both for the mind and the body, Spinoza is searching for a way we can come to correct ourselves and thus know reality with a certainty that would guarantee for us a thoroughly active and affirmative existence, which is an existence defined solely by the active affects of joy and love. There is, therefore, also an ethical aspect to the improvement of the mind that a search for true knowledge is intended to yield. Spinoza calls the joy which a true knowledge of things would imply the “true good.” Such a “true good” is not merely an ephemeral happiness, but instead an eternal joy. Spinoza writes:

After experience had taught me that all the things which regularly occur in ordinary life are empty and futile, and I saw that all the things which were the cause or object of my fear had nothing of good or bad in themselves, except insofar as [my] mind was moved by them, I resolved at last to try to find out whether there was anything which would be the true good, capable of communicating itself, and which alone would affect the mind, all others being rejected—whether there was something which, once found and acquired, would continuously give me the greatest joy, to eternity (TdIE 1).

Spinoza does not deny that searching for true knowledge is a risky gesture. To sacrifice the pleasantries and safety of what everyday experience provides and proclaims as certain is to risk interrupting the comfort of one’s normal routine. In light of this, Spinoza sought to search for true knowledge in a way that would not violate the comfort of his everyday existence, but that would reject what humans usually take to be the highest goods: “riches, honor, and sensual pleasure” (TdIE 3). What this means is that true knowledge will not make you money, give you a popular reputation, or even offer you any momentary delights. Spinoza’s own biography attends to this fact. However, Spinoza was no ascetic. For him, true knowledge does not consist in any misanthropic disavowal of the plight of human beings. Rather, obtaining true knowledge will simply allow one to live with the internal confidence that existence is not defined merely by the indefinite search for finite pleasures. True knowledge will instead empower its possessor to the extent that s/he will be unperturbed by the vacillating conflict of the emotions, or affects, that determine the everyday existence of most humans. In this sense, Spinoza’s emphasis on the affective power of true knowledge is very similar to Stoicism. Ultimately, we should search for true knowledge not only because it will improve our inherent rational ability to check and control our reactive and passive emotions and drives, but because true knowledge will lead us to a direct experience of the essence of all reality, which is an experience that liberates us from finite concerns and endows us with the power and virtue of true blessedness. For Spinoza, true blessedness is an expression of intellectual love towards an eternal and infinite entity: God or Nature. We should search for true knowledge because it will allow us to become truly blessed and wise. Wisdom is true blessedness, or beatitude, for Spinoza. To emend the intellect so that it can use its reason to control its emotions will also allow it, along with becoming wise, to discover the true laws of Nature and common properties of all things. Checking its natural tendency toward reactive passivity and confused perceptions is the self-cultivation of a power essential to the intellect. An emended intellect is, therefore, the perfection of a way of knowing and existing that has searched for and obtained true knowledge.

1b. Knowledge in the Ethics

 

The most mature statement of Spinoza’s philosophy is his Ethics. The Ethics is composed of five parts. The first part gives us Spinoza’s ontology. It deals primarily with what Spinoza regards to be the one true substance or thing that defines reality, which is, once again, God or Nature. Spinoza felt that, prior to discovering how one can know anything, it was best to start any philosophic investigation by establishing the very nature of what is. Getting to God as quickly as possible was only almost an injunction for Spinoza. Spinoza was a substance monist, which means he thought that everything is essentially one thing or substance and that all things are so many modes or ways it modifies or affects itself. The one substance that is everything is infinitely self-causing, self-expressing, and self-sustaining. It is all-powerful, perfect, and real. There is thus only one substance in Nature, as opposed to the many substances philosophers from Aristotle to Descartes had presumed, and that substance is Nature itself. Substance is an indivisible entity of which everything is a modification. The essence of substance, which is its eternal and necessary existence, is what Spinoza calls the attributes. While there is in essence an absolute and indivisible infinity of attributes, we know only two of these attributes: thought and extension. We can know thought and extension because we are ourselves modes of them. Thought is an infinite power of thinking that is God’s idea of himself, while we, our minds and all our thoughts, are so many ways God modifies himself by constitutively expressing himself through an indefinite amount of finite thoughts. In other words, God has and is every idea, while we are just our idea of our ideas of our body and the other bodies that affect us. Extension, likewise, is an infinite power of acting that is God’s infinite and self-causal body (for he is Nature and Nature is essentially physical), while we, our bodies and all the bodies that compose and affect us, are so many ways God modifies himself by constitutively expressing himself through an indefinite amount of finite bodies. In other words, God has and is every body—he is Nature’s naturing (natura naturans)—while we are just our body’s drive to persevere as it intends to actively make stronger compositions with other bodies.

The second part of the Ethics is about the human mind and how it has the ability to emend itself so it can come to know not only its own essence as a finite thing, but also the infinite essence of which it is a mode. The second part teaches us how we can come to know how we are a way God infinitely expresses and continuously causes himself to exist, which is to say we can come to know God’s attributes. We will deal with this part of the Ethics extensively in the sections to come. If the second part teaches us how to strengthen our minds so we can come to know what we really are and how we actually exist as thinking things, then the next two parts of the Ethics (the third dealing with the affects and the fourth their strength) teaches us how to strengthen our bodies so we can come to physically be what we really are and how we actually exist as extended things essentially defined by a desire to persevere. The fifth and final part of the Ethics, dealing with Spinoza’s definition of freedom, synthesizes these approaches and teaches us how to immediately intuit and affirm the infinite and eternal essence we had come to know and embody through the prior parts. The role of knowledge in the Ethics is, therefore, both essential and integral. Through an improvement of our knowledge we can come to be strong and free, or wise and blessed. Spinoza’s understanding and use of knowledge in the Ethics is presented as a way for giving us the means to discover not only the different ways we can know reality, but also the best way we can know it. The ultimate goal of showing us what knowledge is and how we can render it truer—thereby emboldening it with a certain adequacy, power, and clarity and distinctness—is to enable us to obtain that eternal joy which is the very reason why we search for true knowledge in the first place. The role and function of knowledge in the Ethics is to be that way through which we can come to adequately, actively, and rationally exist.

2. Spinoza’s Method for Epistemology

Implied in Spinoza’s epistemology is the admission that there are a variety of ways one can have knowledge. It is also implied in Spinoza epistemology that there is a definitively adequate way for knowing this variety of ways. Spinoza’s method for his epistemology has two aspects, one that is formal and another that is more concerned with the concrete perspectives that define the different ways one can have knowledge.

2a. The Geometric Method

 

It might appear strange that Spinoza waits until part II of the Ethics to address the human mind and the different ways it can have knowledge, considering that the search for the freedom and blessedness of true knowledge is the stated purpose of his thinking. The reason he does this is because of the structural demands of the form in which he wrote the Ethics. Spinoza writes the Ethics in geometric form, which entails that in each part of the text the formal presentation of his arguments involve the use of definitions, axioms, propositions, demonstrations, proofs, scholia, and so on. Formally, the Ethics is written in a way that is similar to Euclid’s Elements. Also, Descartes had popularized the use of geometric form in Spinoza’s time. In opposition to Descartes, however, Spinoza preferred a more synthetic geometric approach than an analytic one. Synthesis is a way of combining primary or axiomatic truths already established as indubitable or self-evident in order to reach other primary truths. To utilize a synthetic geometric method allows one to start with certain ultimate conclusions or truths in order to build a new knowledge from them by demonstrating and proving propositions on their basis. This is why Spinoza starts with God, the one substance that is everything. There are things about God or Nature that simply cannot be denied and that must serve as the basis from which all other knowledge will be derived: that he essentially exists, that he is absolutely infinite, self-causal, conceivable as existing only in and through himself, omnipotent, omniscient, and eternally existing of necessity.

So, in a sense, Spinoza already has absolute knowledge before he reaches it. While the synthetic geometric method was that powerful for him, Spinoza also knew that we, as readers, still needed to progress through the entirety of his text in order to see if and how he was right. Believing that what Spinoza establishes as axiomatically certain is in fact so is a necessary gesture on our part if we are to come to know how Spinoza can start with such perfect knowledge. In other words, Spinoza writes the rest of his Ethics for a reason when he could have just as easily cut everything off after part I, and that reason is that he wants to teach us what we, quite paradoxically, already know as well. The knowledge we all already have is what Spinoza himself explicitly knows as he put it into axiomatic form. The process of coming to have knowledge, for Spinoza, is thus always an explication of a knowledge that is eternally implied in every mind. Spinoza uses the axiomatic geometric form so he does not have to waist time by starting from scratch and eventually discovering the very basis from which he can start through the simple establishment of definitions and axioms. This can be seen as the reason why he never completed the TdIE as well, because it began with the natural inadequacy of our everyday knowledge and sought to overcome it through an almost analytic process of forming a basis from which future knowledge would be capable of discovering the very truth of God that Spinoza and, according to him, we all already know. Such an analytic approach was Descartes’ in his Meditations and it was also probably the main inspiration for Spinoza’s writing the TdIE in the way that he did. By beginning with God and what is absolutely true of him in the Ethics, Spinoza could then show us the variety of ways in which we are inherently both inadequately and adequately knowing God from the start. Spinoza found the destructive tendencies of the analytic method, especially of Descartes’ hyperbolic doubt, to be superfluous because if one has the truth it is not doubted and if it is doubted then it is not the truth and you do not have it.

For Spinoza, it is not that we do not have knowledge of God. The problem is that our knowledge is usually quite poor and confused. But merely by following Spinoza through the Ethics, because of its synthetic geometric form, we come to know that we already have a knowledge that is, in an everyday sense, quite poor. The way to come to know adequately then what we always already know inadequately is to come to know the different ways that knowledge can be known and the different ways knowledge knows things, both of which will become utterly identical through the reflexivity demanded by Spinoza’s epistemology. Such reflexivity, therefore, will constitute Spinoza’s actual method for doing epistemology insofar as the geometric method is the formal presentation of its synthetic necessities, but not its precise application to the different kinds of knowledge. Spinoza says as much in the TdIE when he argues that any true method must be “reflexive knowledge” (TdIE 38). This is not to say that Spinoza’s geometric method does not itself imply reflexivity, but that it is more the form in which a truly reflexive epistemology can be invented and utilized.

2b. The Sub Specie Model, or Perspectivism

 

The truly reflexive way Spinoza does epistemology can be called the sub specie model. Sub specie is Latin for “under the species or aspect of,” or “from the perspective of.” Each aspect or perspective of knowledge is a way of knowing. Spinoza uses the phrase when speaking of how, when we use the common notions and reason that define the second kind of knowledge, we perceive reality “under a certain species of eternity” (EIIP44C2). True knowledge for Spinoza, as we will see, means that one shifts one’s perspective away from imagining reality in terms of the abstractions and quantifications implied by using time (and space) to measure an indefinitely enduring finite existence, to intellectually conceiving reality from the perspective of its own true and indivisible eternity. Insofar as there is only one substance, one real thing, in and as the universe for Spinoza, when we have any knowledge, whether it is true or false, it is necessarily going to be of this substance. The sub specie model states that all the ways of knowing are different ways of knowing one thing and not different ways of knowing substantially different things. Each way of knowing is a perspective on one substance. While our knowledge may be perceived as changing, what we know cannot be truly perceived in such a way.

The sub specie model is reflexive because it allows Spinoza to know how knowledge actually functions while still sustaining his substance monism. He retains his substance monism by affirming the existence of the great variety of ways humans, and moreover all beings, can have knowledge as being so many ways God expresses himself. If all ways of knowing are ways God is known, then God himself, insofar as he is absolutely self-causal and self-expressive, would have to thereby know himself through and as all the different ways he is known. Therefore, from the perspective of God, God knows himself in an infinity of ways, while we, in our everyday existence and from our finite perspective, are just so many of these infinite ways God can both inadequately and adequately know all of reality as himself. But, does this mean that God is actually false as he knows himself inadequately through us? Yes, but only from a finite, limited, and inadequate perspective. On the other hand, while God essentially is the way we know him naturally and inadequately, he is also the adequate knowledge of our inadequate knowledge insofar as he absolutely knows all the ways he is known; or more precisely, he adequately knows himself in every way, from every perspective, he is known. God’s knowledge, therefore, is the absolutely self-reflexive epistemological model we must try to express, experience, embody, intuit, and know if we are to come to have true knowledge ourselves. In other words, we must become as epistemologically self-reflexive as God; that is, we must come to know our inadequate knowledge in the exact way or from the very perspective God adequately knows it.

To come to have adequate or true knowledge is first to come to know how our everyday, finite knowledge is just a way, a particular perspective, of having knowledge and that it is a perspective on God just like every other way of knowing. For us to have an adequately reflexive knowledge is for us to have a reflexive knowledge of God’s reflexive knowledge. That is, we must think God from his own absolutely self-reflexive, self-knowing perspective in order to have adequate knowledge, an adequate knowledge that is both of God and ourselves. For Spinoza, to have an adequate knowledge of epistemology, or adequate knowledge of the ways knowledge knows and is known, is to have an adequate epistemology of epistemology itself. Yet, we must now see how we can arrive at such knowledge. Now we must see the three main ways humans can have knowledge and how we can come to have God’s absolute knowledge of these ways from the absolute perspective he has on himself. We must see how we can shift our perspective to that of God’s absolute perspectivism. We must come to know how we can know reality sub specie aeternitatis.

3. The First Kind of Knowledge

Spinoza defines the first kind of knowledge as the lowest or most inadequate kind. It is also the natural way humans have knowledge. The first kind of knowledge is humanity’s perspective on reality. Spinoza, echoing Parmenides’ [http://www.iep.utm.edu/parmenid/] distinction between aletheia, or truth, and doxa, calls it opinion. The first kind of knowledge is also the only source of falsity (EIIP41).

3a. Imagination

 

For Spinoza, the human being is a singular thing, which means that it has a finite and determined existence (IID7). From one perspective, the human is a mind or thinking thing (IIA2). The human mind both has ideas and is itself an idea. From another perspective, the human is also an extended thing, or a finite and determined body. The human body is both composed of a great many bodies and is affected by a great many other bodies. The human mind and all its thoughts think nothing but the human body, the bodies that go to compose it, and the bodies that affect it (IIP12, 13). The human mind is the idea of the human body and it involves and expresses through all of its ideas all the bodies that compose its body and all the bodies that cause, affect, and determine it. The mind, in its naturally determined singularity, thinks nothing but its body’s affections. Affections are the states or conditions of a body’s reaction to another body’s affecting it. They are the ways both how our body reacts to being affected and how our mind thinks such reactions. From the perspective of the body, affections are usually expressions of receptivity, reactivity, passivity, and weakening on the part of the affected body. Affections are also feelings. Spinoza defines affections in terms of the physical affects, which are the ways the body becomes either stronger or weaker, or more joyful or sad (IIID3). Usually, one’s affections enslave one to a passive existence defined by a diminishing of one’s drive to persevere through forming greater and stronger compositions with other stronger bodies. From the perspective of the mind, affections are images of its affected body (and its increase or decrease in active power or freedom) and the bodies that affect it. Even though affections are things reactively received, they are also those thoughts through which the mind can posit as present the actual existence of its own affected body and all the bodies that affect it. As images, affections are still, even while passively received, essentially positive. Spinoza writes, “the affections of the human body whose ideas present external bodies as present to us, we shall call images of things…and when the mind regards bodies in this way, we shall say that it imagines” (IIP17S).

Now, for Spinoza, the human mind has knowledge of the singular existence of any body insofar as it imagines it. The problem, however, is that any knowledge based on passive affections, or images, is a partial, confused, mutilated (or fragmented), and inadequate knowledge. “Insofar as the human mind imagines an external body, it does not have an adequate knowledge of it” (IIP26C). Any idea, which is itself also an image, of an affection that is an image of an affected or affecting body inadequately expresses the true nature of such bodies. An image is inadequate, an inadequate idea, because it expresses only a confused and mutilated understanding of how a body affects another and what a body essentially is as a self-causal and affecting entity. For a body to imagine other bodies as actively, affectively, and causally determining the form of its existence is for a body to betray its own very minimal ability to be active, affective, and causal itself. Imagination is, therefore, submission to external determination. Through the imagination, a singular mind and body is defined solely by how other bodies determine its existence. The inadequacy of imagining is an expression of mental and physical weakness, for it is only a partial explanation of how bodies are essentially active and self-causally striving for an enhanced perseverance. An inadequate knowledge—a knowledge that merely posits as presently existing externally affective bodies and one’s own passively affected body—is a weak knowledge and, for Spinoza, is thus the very definition of falsity.

As long as I am merely receiving my affections and passively imagining the bodies that affect me, I express an inadequate and false knowledge of things. As long as I merely imagine bodies, I am not internally self-determining and explicitly expressive of the truly self-causal and active essence of all things and myself. Images are like the scars or traces bodies leave on me as they batter me because of my mental and physical sadness and weakness. Images are “like conclusions without premises” (IIP28D). By merely imagining bodies, I am enslaved to the common order of Nature, with its incessantly active, functioning, and self-causally moving bodies. By being so enslaved I understand Nature’s common order not in its inherently intellectual rationality, but rather as the fortuitous run of circumstance one endures through casual, vague, and random experiences (IIP40S2). It is important to emphasize, however, that the positivity implicit in false ideas cannot be the cause of their falsity, and that falsity does not involve a total privation of knowledge. Images are not non-beings devoid of all expressive content. Falsity is still an expression of the fact that all singular things exist; it is just that it is the weakest way of knowing this fact.  In other words, inadequacy is the lowest degree of actual and active knowing and existing for Spinoza. Falsity is the poorest way of knowing God or Nature, that is, the poorest way it knows itself.

Spinoza defines a few other characteristics of the falsity of the first kind of knowledge. Affections, or images, are the sensations through which singular beings think and feel their externally determined bodies. Knowledge that stems entirely from sense perception is inadequate and false. Sense perception also defines a kind of knowing that forms only fictitious ideas of things (TdIE 52-56). These fictions are uncertain ideas of what constitutes the essential and necessary existence of things. Knowledge of the first kind is also knowledge based on signs and hearsay (TdIE 19). Signs and hearsay, along with all knowledge based on memory, give us knowledge of “almost everything that is of practical use in life” (TdIE 20). The good and common sense that makes everyday experiences and relations possible involve neither the clarity and distinctness nor the internal and self-causal adequacy that the truth requires. Instead, an everyday human existence is defined by a collective opining on the part of a multitude of singular beings that do not have the rational strength to overcome their enslavement to partially expressing through fragmented and confused ideas their passivity and externally determined existence.

3b. Prejudice and Superstition

 

One of Spinoza’s favorite examples of falsity is the illusion of free will that is so often propagated by the mutilated imagination of human beings. It is a natural prejudice of humans to assume they have liberty. Spinoza writes, “men are deceived in that they think themselves free [i.e., they think that, of their own free will, they can either do a thing or forbear doing it], an opinion which consists only in this, that they are conscious of their actions and ignorant of the causes by which they are determined” (EIIP35S). Humans imagine they get to make choices because their knowledge is an inadequate expression of what actually determines them to do everything they do, which includes them imagining they have free will. Spinoza is a thinker of determinism and necessitarianism. Humans are necessarily determined to be prejudicial and not know why or how. It is natural law, for Spinoza, that “men are born ignorant of the causes of things” (IApp). Spinoza next notes that humans often turn their prejudicial assumption of free will into the dogma of divine choice. Humans take their imaginary freedom based on contingency and possibility and apply it to a transcendent creator of the entire universe. The human image of God is of a being with an omnipotent reservoir of choices. Because humans find such an image staggering they are terrified they may choose something (namely, a form of worship) that God either has not himself chosen or that he has deemed to be morally reprehensible. Humans thus allow their prejudicial free will to congeal into a superstitious obsession with the impenetrable and inexhaustible free will of God (IApp). All of this is grossly inadequate and false, for Spinoza, for it merely doubles the error of free will and enslaves singular beings to an almost complete irrationality.

3c. Miracles, Prophecy, and Revelation

 

Another example of falsity that Spinoza gives is an extension of prejudice and superstition. It is the religious instinct to believe in the miraculous and prophetic, both of which depend upon the imagined reception of the revelation of God’s free choices. In the case of miracles, the necessity of natural laws is broken by an ultimately unknowable divine decision (TTP, 6). Once again, humans explain away their ignorance of the causes that determine them by imagining a substantial interruption in the natural order of things. While a miracle is imagined to provide humans with what they perceive to be an advantage, an omen is the negative counterpart to a miracle, but it still expresses the same falsity. Certain types of humans take advantage, for political purposes, of the inadequacy of the prejudicial and superstitious nature of those who are susceptible to believing in miracles and omens—that is, the multitude—by declaring their own ability to receive directly the revelation of the immediate results of God’s choices and commands. These beings are prophets and priests, and prophecy for Spinoza is nothing but a clever way of exploiting and disciplining the multitude through the use of an agile and vivid imagination (TTP, 1). For Spinoza, “revelation has occurred through images alone” (TTP, 1), which means that all religions based on revelation are essentially false. Revelation is an utterly inadequate and inappropriate way of understanding God.

4. The Second Kind of Knowledge

In light of the passive and inadequate state of our everyday knowledge and existence, beset as we are by an external determination of our singular existence by all the bodies we confusedly imagine as affecting us, Spinoza aims to establish the ways in which we can overcome our falsity and weakness and come to have an adequate and active knowledge. The first step to becoming adequate for Spinoza is for one to actively and reflexively shift one’s perspective away from the imagination to that of the rational powers inherent to the intellect. This self-activation of the intellect occurs through the formation of common notions, which are concepts that express the universal properties of all things.

4a. Intellection

 

Spinoza never supplied a clear-cut definition of the intellect. He appears to offer three different kinds of intellects. One is simply our finite mind. Another is the immediately caused and infinite in kind modal intellect that is common to and shared by all finite intellects. And there is a third kind of intellect that is God’s absolutely infinite and indivisibly self-causal thinking of himself, or the attribute of thought itself that goes to define God’s essential existence. These three intellects are implicit in each other as they are taken from their own explicit perspectives. From the explicit perspective of the finite intellect, for example, the imagination constitutes the vast majority of one’s thoughts, even though, Spinoza argues, implicit to a finite thinking is the infinite in kind thinking of which it is a part and the indivisibly infinite thinking it truly and essentially is. In order to emend our finite intellect so that it is no longer enslaved to imagining, but instead conceives what is implicit to its thinking, Spinoza shows us how to reflect upon the very nature of our minds and find what it is about it that we know with a fair degree of certainty. By reflecting upon our imagination we cannot but notice that imagining is the way we necessarily think in our usual condition and that we, even prior to noting that we are necessarily imagining beings, also notice that we are necessarily things that think. It is through this reflection upon the natural necessity of the inadequacy of our thinking that we begin to affirm with a certain clarity and distinctness something essential about ourselves as thinking things and so shift our perspective away from only explicitly imagining. For Spinoza, it follows from the necessity of the order of Nature that human beings inadequately imagine all that affects them and thus also imagine all of what they think (EIIP36). But it is this very thought of the necessity of our being singular entities that inadequately imagine that activates the powers of our intellect. By intellectually affirming the natural necessity that we as imagining beings are determined from without and follow a natural order, we can thereby come to know and internally affirm our own essential necessity in light of this order. The activation of the finite intellect is also the self-ordering of the affections or images that usually constitute a finite mind. To intellectually order one’s affections in the way they are necessarily and naturally determined is to begin to know both the conditions for their being caused and what in fact causes them as so many modes that follow and flow from an infinite mode of God.

An active finite intellect is a mind that knows that it falsely imagines the bodies that affect it. But to know one’s falsity truly for Spinoza is for one to know the truth because the truth is the standard both of itself and falsity (IIP43S). By reflecting on such a slight enhancement of knowledge, a finite intellect can increase its activity even more by beginning to understand the necessity and natural order it now knows it follows, and now orders its affection in accordance with, as being something of which it is a part and mode. For a mind, as it begins to actively conceive of its nature as a way Nature necessarily functions and follows from itself, it can begin to use its intellective capacities to know the essence of the infinite thinking that must be common to it and that it must be a way or mode of in order to be a thinking thing at all. For a body, as it begins to actively affect and determine the bodies that were formerly affecting and determining it, it can begin to compose greater composites of other bodies with these bodies it now determines and so strengthen its own essential activity and joy. In order for both the mind and the body to do this, what is common to all singular beings must be adequately known and conceived.

4b. Common Notions

Spinoza argues that what is common to all singular things cannot constitute the essence merely of one or an indefinite amount of particular things, but rather must be “equally in the part and the whole” (IIP37) of all singular things. This is because “those things which are common to all, and which are equally in the part and in the whole, can only be conceived adequately” (IIP38). The question is then, what is common to all singular things? If the intellect is activated through an affirmation of the necessity of the natural order of determinations it is a part of, it becomes even more active if it can conceive what all intellects must constitute as the entire or whole order of thinking itself. What is common to all finite intellects is an infinite intellect of which they are all modes and parts. For a finite intellect to conceive of the whole infinite intellect that it goes to compose, and thus is a way that it modifies itself, is for it to render its thinking adequate. The adequacy of conceiving what is common to all finite thinking is an expression of truth, or clarity and distinctness, for Spinoza.

All singularly thinking things agree in certain respects. One way they all agree is that they are all determined to imagine affections. Another is the simple fact that they all think. And another is that they all modify both an infinite in kind thinking, which is the inherent unity of all thinking as it is immediately caused by God, and also an indivisibly infinite thinking, which is God’s absolute thought of himself. All intellects are modes of an infinite intellect conceivable both as an immediately caused unity of finite intellects and an indivisible identity of all intellectual activity as being one absolutely infinite and eternally self-causal thinking. Spinoza argues that the common notion of the infinite intellect—from both its infinite in kind, immediately caused and indivisibly infinite, self-causal perspectives—is “common to all men” (IIP38C), which also means that it is inherent to the finite intellects of all singular beings. Every thinking thing cannot but implicitly think what is common to it, what it shares with other thinking things, what it is a part of, what it is essentially a unity of, and what it essentially is as a way God thinks himself. The process whereby a finite intellect thinks its inherent common notions is the active becoming of its explicit expression of the truth of all thinking things. The common notion the finite intellect adequately expresses as it becomes increasing active and self-determined is the clear and distinct idea of the immediate and infinite in kind intellect it modifies by being a part of it and the attribute of thought it modifies as an indivisible way God modifies itself.

There is another common notion implicit to an activated and adequate finite intellect, and it is a conception of what is common to all singular bodies. Insofar as all thoughts are actually the bodies and affections they think because of Spinoza’s doctrine of the parallel identity of thoughts and bodies, the common notions of the infinite intellect and the attribute of thought are also clear and distinct conceptions of the immediate and infinite in kind mode of extension and extension itself. It is of the nature of bodies first of all to be extended things. Secondly, it is of the nature of all extended things to indefinitely compose with and decompose each other. All bodies agree in that they are all each both parts of a larger whole and themselves wholes with parts. The fact that all bodies are alive for Spinoza leads this compositional structure of all bodies to be constantly in flux. Therefore, what is also common to all bodies, along with being extended composites, is the fact that they are all moving at different speeds. To be a singular body is to be an indefinitely composing and decomposing extended composite that speeds up or slows down (IIP13, Ep 32). Spinoza calls the immediate and infinite in kind mode of extension “motion and rest.” Motion and rest is the whole or unity of all bodies conceived as one individual body that is all the degrees of compositional movement. All singular bodies are modes of motion and rest, which is itself the immediate and infinite in kind mode of the indivisibly infinite and absolutely self-modifying attribute of extension, or what Spinoza calls Nature naturing (natura naturans). Motion and rest parallels the infinite in kind intellect, and both are in essence the attributes they immediately modify and follow from, which is God’s indivisibly self-causal essence.

4c. Reason

 

Spinoza next needs to show us how we can conceive of these common notions through our affections. For Spinoza, we are very affected. The more we are affected the more we think, but usually imagine, what affects us. But now we know how to adequately conceive of the true nature, the essential properties, of all singular things. Through common notions we can open ourselves up to a plethora of affections without becoming enslaved to them because of our reflexive and perspectival ability to know the necessity and intellectual order of all things, that is, to know all things either as ways an infinite intellect thinks or as ways the whole of Nature compositionally moves. To be active and affirmative toward one’s affections is to use reason to understand how they determine one to exist. But reason is not merely a calm reception of affections. Through an adequate conception and utilization of the reasoning power of the common notions one can become the active cause of all of what one is affected by. The power to be affectively causal in one’s own right is reason’s ability to make us truly free. True freedom, for Spinoza, is the affirmative following of divine or natural necessity. By being rational one can control and order all of one’s affections by conceiving what it truly common to what one is affected by and thus thinks. To open oneself up to an indefinite amount of affections, and yet still rationally control one’s reactions to them, is to actually compose with all such bodies by forming a greater, stronger, and more joyful whole. Through a rational use of the implicit truth and power of the common notions inherent to the intellect one can become the very means through which the unity, and even more the absolute indivisibility, of God or Nature can be intuitively affirmed and embodied through one’s own essential existence.

5. The Third Kind of Knowledge

 

If the truth and adequacy of the common notions activate our intellectual capacity to rationally control our emotions and causally determine the bodies around us to enter into greater and stronger compositions, thereby liberating us into the absolute necessity of God’s natural and lawful order, then it is the intuition, the intuitive knowledge and embodiment, of this truth that will make us eternally wise and blessed. Blessedness consists in loving God with the love whereby he loves himself (VP36), and to intellectually love God not only gives us a blessed existence, it also gives us eternal joy. With the third kind of knowledge, knowledge is solely sub specie aeternitatis.

5a. Intuition

Spinoza defines the third kind of knowledge as a “kind of knowing that proceeds from an adequate idea of the formal essence of certain attributes of God to the adequate knowledge of the [formal] essence of things” (IIP40S2). The second kind of knowledge supplies us with the adequate idea that all singular things must be unified into something immediately caused by God (the infinite in kind and immediate modes) and that all singular things are modes of certain attributes of God (thought and extension). With the third kind of knowledge we can know an attribute not merely through a common notion, but as the essential existence itself of God’s indivisible infinity and eternal necessity. The third kind of knowledge is the knowledge that knows the essence of each and every thing as a way that God causes himself to exist. Knowing a singular thing without the explicit mediation of knowing what it composes into or is as a part of an immediate causal order and connection, is to know it intuitively as simply being a way God eternally and infinitely exists. Intuition is intellectual knowledge taken beyond the immediacy of the infinite in kind. Intuition is more immediate than immediacy; it is affirmative identification, the absolutely self-reflexive identification and knowledge of God and his modes through oneself. Intuition is the absolute affirmation of the natural and necessary eternity of God’s attributes as essentially being the singular things he expresses of himself. Intuition is the knowledge that all things are one thing that God is, that all his attributes are the modes with which he modifies himself. We can know through the essence of singular things that the certain attributes they modify are also the indivisibility of all of God’s attributes, insofar as “no attribute of substance can be truly conceived from which it follows that substance can be divided” (IP12). Intuition is what allows us to know not merely the attributes we modify, but to know both ourselves as the attributes we modify and all the attributes themselves as being the essential existence of all things that is God. In other words, intuition allows us to know all the attributes as the ways God is one indivisible and absolutely immanent entity. Through an intuition of God’s essence one can know the infinity and eternity of one’s own mind and body. To shift one’s perspective to that of God’s is to conceive of the eternal aspect of all things and to intuitively see oneself through God’s absolute perfection and power.

5b. Love and Blessedness

 

For Spinoza, to intuit God is to love God. The intuition of God is the intellectual love of his essential existence, with love being that power of intuition that makes intellection (the exercise of the intellect) more immediate than the immediacy known through the common notions of the second kind of knowledge. Love is defined, on the one hand, as “joy with the accompanying idea of an external cause” (IIIP13S), but, on the other hand, with the intellectual love of God the idea of the cause of such joy is more an internal cause than an external one because through the third kind of knowledge one knows absolutely that God constitutes one’s own essential existence. In a finite sense, joy is an increase in perfection, but the joy involved in the intellectual love of God is almost an identification of one’s love with God’s very absolute perfection, or infinite self-love. God’s absolute self-love is his indivisibly infinite and eternal self-causal power to essentially exist as all things. The third kind of knowledge, intuitive knowledge, loves this self-love in the way that it loves itself. The intellectual love of God is the absolute knowledge of all the ways one can know God and all the ways God knows himself as an infinity of ways he conceives and loves his own truth for all eternity. It is with the aid of the affective power of reason that our liberation into true necessity is affirmed even more intensely as we come to embody the freedom to conceive of the universe from its own eternally living and infinitely natural perspective of absolute perfection, power, and reality.

The third kind of knowledge endows us with a kind of immortality. It is not that we exist in our perceived or imagined finite form for all eternity, because all finite bodies and the ideas and affections of them decompose, but that we exist eternally by shifting our perspective and our knowledge to that of the infinity and eternity of God’s indivisibly physical self-conception and self-knowledge (VP29). Spinoza writes, “Insofar as our mind knows itself and the body under a species of eternity, it necessarily has knowledge of God, and knows that it is in God and is conceived through God” (VP30). To intuit God through an intellectual love of his essential existence, and thereby conceive all things from his eternal perspective, is to render our adequate knowledge and rational freedom truly divine. Blessedness is the virtue, rarity, excellence, and power of our absolute knowledge of God’s absolute knowledge. Absolute knowledge is thus divine wisdom.

6. References and Further Reading

All passages from the texts of Spinoza are taken from the translations appearing in The Collected Works of Spinoza. Vol. I. Edited and translated by Edwin Curley. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985). Passages from the Ethics are cited according to Book (I - V), Definition (D), Axiom (A), Proposition (P), Corollary (C), and Scholium (S). For example, (IVP13S) refers to Ethics, Book IV, Proposition 13, Scholium. Passages from the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect are cited according to paragraph number. For example, (TdIE 35) refers to Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, paragraph 35.

  • Curley, Edwin, “Experience in Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Grene, (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973), 25-59.
  • Curley, Edwin, Filippo Magnini, and W. N. A Klever (eds). Spinoza’s Epistemology, vol.2 of Studia Spinozana. (Hanover: Walther & Walther Verlag, 1986).
  • De Dijn, Herman. Spinoza: The Way to Wisdom. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press, 1996).
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Spinoza: Practical Philosophy. (San Francisco: City Lights Books, 1988).
  • Della Rocca, Michael. Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza. (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996).
  • Floistad, Guttorm, “Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge in the Ethics” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Grene, (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973), 101-127.
  • Garret, Don, “Spinoza,” in A Companion to Epistemology, ed. Ernest Sosa and Jonathan Dancy, (Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1992), 488-490.
  • Garrett, Don, “Representation and Consciousness in Spinoza’s Naturalistic Theory of the Imagination” in Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays, ed. Charlie Huenemann, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008), 4-25.
  • Huenemann, Charlie, “Epistemic Autonomy in Spinoza,” in Interpreting Spinoza: Critical Essays, ed. Charlie Huenemann, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008), 94-110.
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, Part of Nature: Self-Knowledge in Spinoza's Ethics. (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1994).
  • Mark, Thomas Carson. Spinoza's Theory of Truth. (New York: Columbia University Press, 1972).
  • Parkinson, G. H. R., Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1954).
  • Parkinson, G. H. R., “Language and Knowledge in Spinoza” in Spinoza: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Grene, (Garden City, NY: Doubleday/Anchor Press, 1973), 73-100.
  • Wilson, Margaret D., “Spinoza’s Theory of Knowledge” in The Cambridge Companion to Spinoza, ed. Don Garrett, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), 89-141.

Author Information

Nels Dockstader
Email: jdocksta@uwo.ca
The University of Western Ontario
Canada

Reliabilism

Reliabilism encompasses a broad range of epistemological theories that try to explain knowledge or justification in terms of the truth-conduciveness of the process by which an agent forms a true belief. Process reliabilism is the most common type of reliabilism. The simplest form of process reliabilism regarding knowledge of some proposition p implies that agent S knows that p if and only if S believes that p,  p is true, and S’s belief that p is formed by a reliable process. A truth-conducive or reliable process is sometimes described as a belief-forming process that produces either mostly true beliefs or a high ratio of true to false beliefs. Process reliabilism regarding justification, rather than knowledge, says that S’s belief that p is justified if and only if S’s belief that p is formed by a reliable process.  This article discusses process reliabilism, including its background, motivations, and well-known problems. Although the article primarily emphasizes justification, it also discusses knowledge, followed by brief descriptions of other versions of reliabilism such as proper function theory, agent and virtue reliabilism, and tracking theories.

Table of Contents

  1. Background and Anti-Luck Predecessors of Process Reliabilism
    1. Brief Background
    2. Anti-Luck Predecessors of Process Reliabilism
  2. Process Reliabilist Theories of Justification and Knowledge
    1. Goldman’s “What Is Justified Belief?”
    2. Some Unresolved Issues
    3. Some Theoretical Commitments of Reliabilism
  3. Objections and Replies
    1. Reliably Formed True Belief Is Insufficient for Justification
    2. Reliably Formed True Belief Is Not Necessary for Justification
    3. The Problem of Easy Knowledge
    4. The Value Problem for Reliabilism
    5. The Generality Problem
  4. Proper Function and Agent and Virtue Reliabilism
    1. Plantinga’s Proper Function Account
    2. Agent and Virtue Reliabilism
  5. Tracking and Anti-Luck Theories
    1. Sensitivity
    2. Safety
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Background and Anti-Luck Predecessors of Process Reliabilism

a. Brief Background

The nature of the knowledge-constituting link between truth and belief is a principal issue in epistemology.  Nearly all philosophers accept that a person, S, knows that p (where p is a proposition), only if S believes that p and p is true.  But true belief alone is insufficient for knowledge because S may believe that p without adequate or perhaps any grounds or evidence.  If, for example, S believes that p merely because he or she guesses that p, then the connection between S’s belief that p and the truth that p is too flimsy to count as knowledge.  S might just as easily have guessed that not-p and thus have been wrong.

Dating back to Plato’s Theaetetus, philosophical tradition held that knowledge is justified true belief (although it is debatable whether Plato's ‘logos’, often translated simply as account, corresponds to the contemporary idea of justification, and Plato himself found the true belief with logos explication of knowledge wanting).   Although the nature of justification is a matter of considerable debate, a central idea is that when a belief is justified it is far likelier to be true than when it is not justified.  Reliabilists put this notion of truth-conduciveness front-and-center in their accounts of justification and knowledge.

F.P. Ramsey (1931) is often credited with the first articulation of a reliabilist account of knowledge.  He claimed that knowledge is true belief that is certain and obtained by a reliable process.  That idea lay more-or-less dormant until the 1960s, when reliabilist theories emerged in earnest.  A crucial development occurred when Edmund Gettier (1963) demonstrated that even justified true belief is insufficient for knowledge.  The diagnosis of the counterexamples Gettier provided is that an agent can obtain true beliefs with very solid grounds and yet the agent could still easily have been wrong.  It is only by luck or coincidence that the agent’s source of justification leads to true belief.  That is, the agent’s true belief is infected by knowledge-precluding "epistemic luck." It is difficult to say just how much Gettier’s paper motivated reliabilist accounts of justification and knowledge, especially since, as discussed below, process reliabilism regarding justification is somewhat detached from concerns about epistemic luck.  It is nonetheless clear that Gettier's counterexamples led to fresh thinking about the knowledge-constituting link between belief and truth, and that process reliabilism emerged as a theory-type from some of the responses to Gettier.  This section briefly addresses precursors to process reliabilism that aim to eliminate luck, with the aim of giving a partial, reconstructed genealogy of process reliabilism.  Section 5 discusses other versions of reliabilism that explicitly address epistemic luck.

b. Anti-Luck Predecessors of Process Reliabilism

Alvin Goldman is perhaps the most influential proponent of reliabilism.  Goldman (1967) responded to Gettier by arguing that knowledge is true belief caused in an appropriate way. Goldman left the notion of "appropriate" open-ended, awaiting scientific discovery of causal mechanisms that reliably yield true belief.  To see how Goldman’s causal theory attempts to eliminate epistemic luck, consider the following Gettier counterexample.  Smith has very good evidence that Jones owns a Ford, but has no idea of the whereabouts of his friend, Brown.  Smith forms the belief, via competent deduction from the justified premise that Jones owns a Ford, that either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Barcelona.  It turns out that Jones does not own a Ford—perhaps Jones showed Smith a fake title while giving Smith a ride home in the Ford—but Brown is, by coincidence, in Barcelona.  Smith’s disjunctive belief is true and justified, but clearly not a case of knowledge.  Goldman’s causal theory correctly diagnoses this case, because the specific fact that makes Smith’s disjunctive belief true—that Brown is in Barcelona—is not a causal antecedent of Smith’s belief.  Rather, Smith believes what he does because he has evidence that Jones owns a Ford.

Goldman recognized that his causal theory still permitted knowledge-precluding epistemic luck (Goldman, 1976).  A crucial counterexample to the causal theory (and to many others) is the famous barn facsimile case.  Driving through the countryside, Henry points out a barn to his son, saying, “That’s a barn.”  It so happens that all the other “barns” in the area are mere façades meant to look exactly like barns from the road.  Does Henry know that the ostended object is a barn?  On Goldman’s causal theory, the answer is "yes," since perception of the actual barn causes Henry to believe that it is a barn.  But Henry just got lucky.  He could very easily have pointed to a façade and formed the false belief that it is a barn, and therefore Henry does not know that the object he pointed to is a barn.

Although the fake barn example does not fit the precise mold of Gettier's cases, it is nonetheless a case of epistemic luck, whose common feature is that the agent has a true belief that could easily have been false—the link between belief and truth is too weak to constitute knowledge.  To shore up that link, Goldman (1976) introduced his discrimination account of perceptual knowledge.  Goldman says, “S has perceptual knowledge if and only if not only does his perceptual mechanism produce true belief, but there are no relevant counterfactual situations in which the same belief would be produced via an equivalent percept and in which the belief would be false” (Goldman 1976, 786).  In the fake barns case, because the countryside is filled with barn façades that Henry cannot distinguish from actual barns, there is a relevant counterfactual situation where what Henry sees matches his perception of the real barn, leading him to believe falsely that he sees a barn.  Because Henry’s belief thereby fails to satisfy Goldman’s discrimination requirement, Henry does not know that what he sees is a barn.

Goldman’s discrimination theory makes reference to the notion of a relevant alternative, which is now a staple of epistemological theorizing.  Usually, when a theorist exploits the idea of relevant alternatives, it signals a commitment to fallibilism.  In many cases, an agent knows that p because she can distinguish the state of affairs where p is true from possibilities where p is false—she can “rule out” those other possibilities.  For example, S knows the cat is on the mat when she sees that it is, because if the cat were not on the mat she would see that it is not and would not believe that the cat is on the mat.  But S cannot and, on many relevant alternatives accounts, need not rule out all logical counter-possibilities, such as a scenario where S is a brain-in-a-vat (BIV), having her experiences “fed” to her by a mad scientist through electrodes connected to the brain, in which case all her beliefs about the external world would be false.  S knows (says the fallibilist) but she is not infallible.

A full discussion of the myriad ways in which philosophers construe relevant alternatives is beyond the scope of this article.  On Goldman’s discrimination account, an alternative is relevant if it is a situation that occurs in a nearby possible world.  Though appeals to possible worlds are controversial—Which worlds are possible?  How do we know which are nearby and which are distant?—intuitively, a possible world where the cat is not on the mat but is on her bird-watching perch is closer to the actual world than one where S is a BIV having cat-on-the-mat images fed directly to her brain.  This may sound question-begging against the skeptic who insists that, for all S knows, the actual world could be one where S is a BIV, and so S cannot achieve any empirical knowledge because she cannot rule out that possibility.  However, it is uncontroversial that S knows that p only if p is true.  So when analyzing ‘S knows that p’—that is, when explicating the conditions in which ‘S knows that p’ is true—the actual world is one where p is true; where, for example, the cat is on the mat.  (More on the distinction between formulating necessary and sufficient conditions for ‘S knows that p’ and arguing that human agents in fact have knowledge, below.)  Given that it is true that the cat is on the mat, the possibility that the cat is on her perch is far closer to the actual world than the possibility that there are no cats, mats or perches and that S is just a BIV being fed such images.

To this point, there has been little discussion of process reliabilism.  But the preceding description of Goldman’s early views is useful because it provides the background to his well-known reliabilist theory of justification.  In addition, when the previous discussion is coupled with the following section on reliabilism regarding justification, a broader picture of the basic theoretical commitments of process reliabilism emerges.  The following section looks first at process reliabilism (2a) and then, after canvassing some of its unresolved issues (2b), aims to unpack some of its basic theoretical commitments (2c).  Section 5 of this article discusses tracking theories, often seen as versions of reliabilism that are close in spirit to, and aim to eliminate the kind of epistemic luck revealed in, Goldman’s discrimination account.

2. Process Reliabilist Theories of Justification and Knowledge

Goldman’s process reliabilism is a descendant of his earlier causal and discrimination accounts of knowledge, but constitutes a major change of focus.  For one thing, neither of the earlier theories is explicitly intended as an account of epistemic justification, whereas providing such an account is a central project of Goldman’s process reliabilism.  For another, the requisite knowledge-constituting link between belief and truth, whether or not conceived of as a form of justification, is radically reconstrued.  The causal account asks whether the specific cause of a true belief is sufficient for knowledge.  The discrimination account asks whether there are relevant counterfactual situations in which the percept upon which the given true belief is based would lead S to form a false belief, in which case S does not know that p in the actual case.  Because both accounts focus on specific features of a particular belief , they are versions of local reliabilism.  Process reliabilism, by contrast, asks whether the general belief-forming process by which S formed the belief that p would produce a high ratio of true beliefs to false beliefs.  As with the causal and discrimination accounts, the central question is whether the belief at issue is reliably formed.  But here the answer is determined not by the belief’s unique causal ancestry, or by the nature of the specific percept upon which the belief is based, but by appeal to the truth-conduciveness of the general cognitive process by which it was formed.  This is sometimes called global reliabilism.  It should be noted, however, that Goldman gestures in the direction of process reliabilism, of a global account, in his discrimination paper when he says: “a cognitive mechanism or process is reliable if it not only produces true beliefs in actual situations, but would produce true beliefs…in relevant counterfactual situations” (1976, 771).

a. Goldman's "What Is Justified Belief?"

Goldman proposed an account of process (or global) reliabilist justification in “What Is Justified Belief?” (1979). In the causal and discrimination accounts discussed above, Goldman demurred from describing the knowledge-constituting link between belief and truth as justification.  In summarizing  his discrimination theory, Goldman said, “If one wishes, one can so employ the term ‘justification’ [such] that belief causation of [the discriminatory] kind counts as justification.  In this sense, of course, my theory does require justification.  But this is entirely different from the sort of justification demanded by Cartesianism” (1979, 790).  At least since Descartes, philosophers have traditionally thought of justification internalistically, such that S’s belief is justified only if S is in a position to produce reasons or evidence to support her belief.  Goldman balked at the claim that he was offering a theory of justification because his theories do not require justification as traditionally conceived.  On the other hand, what one calls "justification" is a matter of debate, so it is not implausible to think of any theory aiming to explicate the knowledge-constituting link between truth and belief as a theory of justification.  If, however, one insists that the very idea of justification demands being in a position to offer grounds for belief, one will refrain from calling Goldman’s causal and discrimination accounts theories of justification.  That leaves open the possibility that one could accept some version of a causal or discrimination account of the belief-truth link as a theory of knowledge, and simply deny that knowledge requires justification.  (See Kornblith (2008).  Internalists about knowledge will still be unsatisfied, as they will demand that knowledge itself requires being in a position to offer grounds for belief.  An early and influential version of reliabilism about knowledge is David Armstrong’s Belief, Truth and Knowledge.)

The main point of contention here revolves around how one understands the word "justification".  The term connotes having good reasons or even the act of giving good reasons.  Thus it is not surprising that many philosophers would reject a theory of justification that did not require an agent at least to be able to give reasons for her belief.  But if one thinks of epistemic justification as whatever sufficiently ties an agent’s belief to the truth, externalist accounts like Goldman’s will count as theories of justification.  The debate about justification is why some reliabilists, local and/or global, eschew justification altogether, aiming to directly explicate "knowledge" as true belief with an appropriate link between belief and truth.  These are reliabilist theories of knowledge as opposed to accounts of justification.

(The preceding discussion may seem to suggest that debates about justification are merely terminological, based solely on whether the term "justified" is applicable to a belief when the agent lacks cognitive access to the factors that tie her belief to the truth.  That is, perhaps, too simplistic.  See, for example, Bergmann's Justification Without Awareness for an extended study and defense of externalism that directly engages internalist arguments and positions.)

Goldman (1979) sets out to provide substantive conditions for when a belief is justified (hence this version is explicitly a reliabilist theory of justification as a necessary condition for knowledge).  Now, "justified" is both an epistemic and an evaluative term, and presumably evaluative because epistemic.  If knowledge is justified true belief, the only epistemic constituent of knowledge is justification.  Belief is a psychological notion, and truth is a metaphysical or semantic— at any rate not epistemic— concept.  In addition, the concepts of belief and truth are not evaluative—to believe that p is by itself neither good nor bad, and the truth by itself is neither good nor bad.  (One might think, though, that true belief (or having a true belief) is good.  But as we have seen, an agent can acquire a true belief in all kinds of bad ways—guessing, wishful thinking, hasty generalization, and the like.  There may of course be some instrumental value in having a true belief through some such means—it may help the agent achieve some end—but acquiring a true belief in some such deficient way warrants a negative appraisal of the agent’s belief.  In addition, even if it makes sense to say that true belief is good, it does not follow that truth  or belief  themselves are good; thus of the three constituents of knowledge, only ‘justification’ is by itself an evaluative term, and it is also the only epistemic one.)

Why must a substantive (or illuminating) account of justification eschew epistemic-cum-evaluative terms?  Consider a couple rudimentary alternatives.  1) A belief that p is justified for an agent S if and only if S has good reasons to believe that p.  2) A belief that p is justified for an agent S if and only if S has solid evidence that p.  In both cases there is an obvious next question: Q1) What are good reasons?  Q2) What is solid evidence?  Because the notions of "good reasons" and "solid evidence" are similarly evaluative, they do not cast much light on the epistemic and evaluative concept of justification.  Goldman canvasses several possible theories of justification to show that, when construed as free of epistemic terms, they do not plausibly explicate the notion of justification, and when construed as containing epistemic terms, they leave open the central questions about justification, as seen in our two questions above.

Goldman diagnoses the failure of putative theories or analyses of justification that are properly cashed out in non-epistemic terms.  Though he does not use this terminology (in this paper, but see Goldman (2008)), it will be helpful to introduce the distinct concepts of propositional and doxastic justification.  Suppose we have an analysis of justification which says that a belief that p is justified for S if and only if (some condition) x obtains.  We can then say that a proposition p is justified for S if and only if, whether or not S believes that p, x obtains.  Here, S may not believe that p but may be considering whether p.  Now suppose that S does believe that p.  Then, S is doxastically justified in believing that p if and only if p is propositionally justified for S and S believes that p because x obtains.  Suppose, for example, that Jones sees a blue jay in her back yard and is thus justified in believing there is a blue jay in the back yard.  The existence of a blue jay in the back yard entails that there is at least one animal in the back yard.  Whether or not Jones draws that inference, the proposition that there is at least one animal in the back yard is propositionally justified for Jones.  Now suppose Jones believes that there is at least one animal in the back yard.  Is that belief doxastically justified?  Not if Jones believes it because a notorious liar asserted it.  That there exists propositional justification for an agent does not entail that the agent is doxastically justified in believing the proposition.  Goldman’s insight is that doxastic justification requires that the belief has an appropriate cause, and he goes on to characterize "appropriate cause" as having been produced by a reliable belief-forming process— that is, a process that produces mostly true beliefs or a high ratio of true to false beliefs.  Guessing, wishful thinking, and hasty generalization are unreliable, whereas believing on the basis of a distinct memory, attentive viewing, or valid deduction is reliable.

Philosophers sometimes use other terminology to draw a distinction similar to the one between propositional and doxastic justification.  Feldman and Conee (1985) distinguish justification from "well-foundedness", where the latter requires not only that the agent have (propositional) justification, but also that the agent’s belief is based on that justification.  Others (for example, Moser (1989)) employ the notion of a basing relation to distinguish between an agent’s (merely) having a reason to believe and an agent’s believing because of that reason.  Knowledge requires doxastic justification, or well-founded belief, or belief based on reasons or formed on the basis of a reliable process.

Goldman also distinguishes between basic beliefs and non-basic beliefs.  Basic beliefs are not justified by reference to other beliefs, whereas non-basic beliefs are so justified.  Basic beliefs are justified if and only if they result from (are causal outputs of) an unconditionally reliable process—a process none of whose inputs consist of other beliefs (perceptual beliefs are plausible candidates here).  Non-basic beliefs are justified if and only if they result from a belief-dependent process that is conditionally reliable— that is, a process whose inputs consist partially of other beliefs and which, given that the inputs are true, produces beliefs that are likely to be true.  Memory, which is based on previously formed beliefs, induction on a large and varied base, and deduction might be considered reliable belief-dependent processes.

Because basic beliefs do not have other beliefs as sources of justification, they invite no regress of reasons or justification.  The traditional internalist who insists that justification requires that the agent be in a position to give reasons in support of her belief encounters trouble here.  Where does the justification end?  If an agent offers her belief that q in support of her belief that p, the obvious question is: Why believe that q?  If the answer is, "because r", a potential regress threatens.  It may be infinite, and one might wonder whether an embodied human agent can make use of such an infinite chain to justify her beliefs, or whether such a regress is vicious.  (For a defense of infinitism, see Klein (1999).)  Alternatively, the chain of justification might go round in a circle, where no single belief is independently justified, which raises the concern that the circle is vicious.  Toy version: S believes that p on the basis of q, q on the basis of r, and r on the basis of p.  Third, all of one’s beliefs might be deemed justified because they properly cohere in the sense that they are interdependent and mutually supporting.  But one can have interdependent and mutually supporting beliefs all of which are false.  Whatever else justification is, we noted above that a common thread in epistemological discussions is that a justified belief is more likely to be true than one that is not justified, whereas coherence is compatible with one’s having all false beliefs.  The reliabilist externalist simply opts out of the requirement that reasons are reflectively accessible to the agent by identifying justified beliefs with those that are the outputs of reliable processes, whether or not the process itself includes other beliefs.  If it does not, then the process is belief-independent and the beliefs produced by it are basic.  Put differently, reliabilism makes plausible a form of structural foundationalism which stops the regress of justification, whereas it is difficult for the internalist to cite regress-stopping basic beliefs that are justified but not by other beliefs.

BonJour (1985, chapter 2) presents a master argument against foundationalism in general, and then (chapter 4) presents a dilemma faced by internalist foundationalists who appeal to “the given” as foundational.  The latter goes something like this.  If the given, as what constitutes the justificatory foundation, itself has propositional content, then for that reason it may provide rational justification for the beliefs based on it, but then one wants to know how the foundation is justified, and the regress begins.  If, on the other hand, the given does not have propositional content, then it’s not the sort of thing that needs justification, but then how can it be a reason at all?  How can it justify other beliefs?  This dilemma is part of Bonjour’s larger argument against foundationalism in general, because he recognizes that one could avoid the dilemma faced by internalists by 'going externalist'— that is, by not requiring that all beliefs must be supported by reflectively accessible reasons (by other justified beliefs) to be justified, so long as they are the result of a reliable process.  BonJour rejects this maneuver because he thinks the very ideas of knowledge and justification require reflectively accessible reasons.

A feature of this account that Goldman himself touts is that process reliabilism is an historical theory.  Whereas traditional Cartesian justification and many other theories construe justification as a function of only current mental states of an agent, Goldman emphasizes the belief’s causal history.  An historical account is naturally coupled with externalism because on the traditional internalist theory of justification one’s reasons must be reflectively accessible at the time of belief.  If the latter requirement is rejected, it opens the possibility that a belief may be partly justified by past events in the causal chain leading to belief.  And if those justificatory factors were reflectively accessible at the time of belief, that they occurred in the past would be irrelevant.  Thus reflective accessibility (internalism) naturally pairs with what Goldman calls "current time-slice" theories, whereas externalism naturally pairs with an historical theory.

When naturally coupled with externalism, an historical conception of justification makes intelligible some intuitive cases of knowledge that an internalist conception fails to capture. For example, suppose S read years ago about a certain fact in a reliable source.  S now recalls that fact, but cannot remember the source from which she obtained it.  S is not in a position to offer reasons for her belief— in response to a challenge about why she believes what she does, she may say, “I just do”—but, if her memory is reliable, then the belief might plausibly be considered justified.

As mentioned briefly in §1, Goldman’s process reliabilism is not designed to handle some forms of epistemic luck, such as Gettier cases.  It is conceived, rather, as an alternative to (and improvement over) traditional theories of justification, and we saw above how a belief can be true and justified but not a case of knowledge because of luck.  Thus Goldman: “Justified beliefs…have appropriate causal histories; but they may fail to be knowledge either because they are false or because they founder on some other requirement for knowing of the kind discussed in the post-Gettier knowledge-trade” (1979, 15).

In sum, Goldman proposes a theory of justification according to which a belief is doxastically justified for an agent S just in case S’s belief is formed from a reliable, that is truth-conducive, belief-independent process (for basic beliefs) or from a conditionally reliable belief-dependent process (for non-basic beliefs).  Further details need to be filled in, but on some of these issues Goldman offers suggestions but remains agnostic.

b. Some Unresolved Issues

First, what exactly does one mean by a process that is "truth-conducive" or "has a tendency to produce true belief"?  Does it mean that, in the long run, the process actually produces mostly true beliefs?  Or does it mean that it would produce mostly true beliefs if it were used?  For example, suppose that Jones, blind from birth, undergoes  new eye surgery that provides him with 20-20 vision.  He wakes up, sees a very realistic-looking  stuffed cat, hears a creature “meowing”  nearby, and forms the false belief that the stuffed cat is a real cat.  Deathly afraid of cats, he goes into cardiac arrest and dies.  He has formed one belief based on vision, but it is false.  Ought we to conclude that his vision is unreliable because it produced only false belief?  Presumably not, and so reliability should not be construed in terms of the actual outputs of a process.  Goldman sees this and says: “For the most part, we simply assume that the ‘observed’ frequency of truth versus error would be approximately replicated in the actual long-run, and also in relevant counterfactual situations, i.e. ones that are highly ‘realistic’, or conform closely to circumstances of the actual world” (1979, 11).  Is the suggestion, then, that we use observed frequency as a guide to what would happen in the long run, or in worlds similar to the actual world?  This won’t work in the case just described.  Or is the suggestion that we can dispense with observed frequency and think instead in terms of how the process would perform in the long run or in close possible worlds?  And if so, what is the basis of our understanding of how it would perform?  Reliabilists owe answers to these questions, but so far no one set of answers is generally accepted.

Second, which are the worlds in which a process must be reliable to constitute justification?  Suppose there is a possible world where a benevolent demon arranges things such that beliefs based on wishful-thinking always turn out to be true.  Wishful-thinking would be truth-conducive, but we would hesitate to say that those beliefs are justified.  One way to repair this defect is to say that a belief in a possible world w is justified if and only if it is formed from a process that is reliable in the actual world.  But what if, unbeknownst to us, wishful-thinking is reliable in the actual world?  Goldman’s suggestion here is that what we seek is an explanation of why we deem some beliefs justified and others not, and what we deem justified depends not on actual facts about reliability but on what we believe about reliability.  So even if wishful-thinking were in fact reliable, because we do not believe it to be, it would not count as a basis for justification.

It is worth pausing here to note a consequence of the distinction between reliabilist theories of justification and reliabilist theories of knowledge.  The consequence is not a logical one, but it appears real enough.  Goldman wants to improve upon the traditional notion of justification, and as a result he must take seriously basic judgments about when a belief is justified.  Because it seems counterintuitive to deem wishful-thinking a basis for justification (even in a benevolent demon world), Goldman suggests a shift from actual reliability to what we believe about reliability as the basis for justification.  But in so doing, the original novel insight that justification depends on facts, some historical, about reliability loses its grip.  If, on the other hand, a theorist were not concerned to elucidate "justification" in a reliabilist theory of knowledge, she would be less inclined to feel the pull of intuitions about justification.  She could say that knowledge is reliably formed true belief and leave it at that.  If some cases of knowledge lacked features typically associated with justification, so be it.

Third, what is a process?  Fundamentally, it simply takes inputs (such as percepts or other beliefs) and yields belief outputs.  But how are processes individuated?  Is vision a process?  Vision in good lighting conditions might well be reliable, but vision in the dark is not.  The point is that processes can be individuated coarsely, such as a process by which beliefs are formed on the basis of vision, or finely, such as where beliefs are formed on the basis of vision in good lighting at close range, and so forth.  Such questions about process individuation must be settled in advance of answers to questions about justification.  This is, again, because process reliabilism is intended to be a substantive account of justification, such that whether a belief is justified is determined by whether the process is reliable.  Because processes can be individuated in myriad ways, one could always cite some suitably refined reliable process to answer to the antecedent judgment that a belief is justified.  But this gets things backwards, since the reliabilist wants to derive facts about justification from antecedent understanding of when a belief is reliably produced.  This is the heart of the generality problem for reliabilism, which will be discussed further in the following section.

c. Some Theoretical Commitments of Reliabilism

Having described both process reliabilism and its historical predecessors, some theoretical commitments common to both come to light.

First, it was noted earlier (1a) that Goldman’s early appeal to relevant alternatives signals a commitment to fallibilism.  Process reliabilism is also fallibilist.  So long as a belief-forming process produces mostly true beliefs, it is a source of justification and knowledge that p, even if the process does not provide the agent with the ability to rule out all counter-possibilities where not-p.  On this view, a belief can be justified but false (which is generally accepted), and, more importantly, S can know that p even when S is susceptible to error because she cannot rule out all the possibilities in which not-p.

Second, closely related to the commitment to fallibilism is a strategy to undermine the skeptic.  The skeptic says that, because S cannot rule out the possibility that she is a BIV (or is dreaming or is deceived by an evil demon), S cannot know even mundane truths about her environment, for example that the cat is on the mat.  But if it is correct that the BIV scenario is an irrelevant alternative, and that one need rule out only relevant alternatives to know that p, it follows that one can know ordinary empirical truths even though the skeptic may be right that one cannot know that one is not a BIV.

Reliabilists need not be committed to the claim that one cannot know that radical skeptical hypotheses, like the BIV scenario, are false, and there are strong theoretical considerations for rejecting it.  Suppose S knows (on some or other reliable grounds) that the cat is on the mat.  Upon reflection, S will also know that if the cat is on the mat, then S is not a BIV (because, ex hypothesi, there are no real cats and mats in the BIV world).  And it would seem that S could easily know, by deduction from known premises, which is a paradigm reliable process, that she is not a BIV.  To claim that there are cases where S cannot achieve knowledge through valid logical deduction from known premises is to deny the principle that knowledge is closed under known entailment, which strikes many as preposterous.  And accepting the closure principle appears to imply either that we can know that radical skeptical hypotheses are false, which strikes many as intuitively incorrect, or that we know nothing about the external world, because if we did, we could logically infer that radical skeptical hypotheses are false.  This issue arises again in section 5 when the discussion turns to particular reliabilist tracking theories that explicitly deny closure.

Third, it is important to understand that the reliabilist primarily aims to produce an account of the nature of knowledge, whereas it is a secondary objective to show that human agents in fact have knowledge.  The skeptical appeal to the BIV scenario is meant as the basis of an a priori argument that knowledge is impossible: S knows a priori that she cannot rule out the BIV possibility because any perceptual experience she could have is compatible with the BIV scenario, and the skeptic argues a priori that S therefore cannot even know that the cat is on the mat, because for all S knows she is a BIV.  Goldman’s causal and discrimination accounts and his subsequent process reliabilist theory counter the skeptic’s claim by saying that if, as a matter of fact, S’s belief that p is caused in the right way (or S can discriminate p from close counter-possibilities or S’s belief is formed from a reliable process), then S knows that p.  Surely any or all of these conditions might hold for S’s belief, and no a priori skeptical argument can demonstrate otherwise.  This is a significant advance against skepticism, because the skeptic must adopt the more defensive position of having to show that these conditions never hold, which is not something that can be proved a priori.  On the other hand, when the reliabilist goes further and tries to show that empirical knowledge is not only possible but actual, she needs to show that her favored conditions for knowledge in fact obtain, and that is a far more difficult task.  This also raises a concern about bootstrapping—where one uses some or other reliable process to infer that her belief-forming processes are in fact reliable—and this smacks of question-begging.  (See “the problem of easy knowledge,” section 3.)

Fourth, and perhaps most importantly, reliabilism is typically construed as a paradigm version of epistemological externalism, which is the thesis that not all aspects of the knowledge-constituting link between belief and truth need be cognitively available to the agent.  (See Steup (2003) for a defense of the claim that any factors that justify belief or constitute the requisite link between belief and truth must be cognitively available to the agent, or “recognizable on reflection”.)  When the skeptic claims that S cannot know that p because, for all S knows, she might be a BIV, the externalist replies that, if in fact the relevant causal, discriminatory, or process reliabilist conditions obtain, whether or not the agent is able to recognize on reflection that they do, and in general whether or not facts about their obtaining are cognitively available to her, S knows that p.  Internalists are often seen as playing into the hands of the skeptic because the cognitively available factors that confer justification on one’s empirical beliefs, such as perceptual evidence, are compatible with the BIV scenario.  Because there are no further means cognitively available to rule out the BIV scenario, the skeptic’s claim that one cannot achieve even ordinary empirical knowledge appears to be more damaging to the internalist than to the externalist.

The points about anti-skepticism and externalism can be brought out in another way.  Because internalists typically demand reflectively accessible reasons for justification, they encounter more difficulty in accounting for cases of unreflective knowledge in adults, and of the kind of knowledge had by unsophisticated or unreflective persons, or perhaps even animals.  A stock example is the chicken-sexer, a person who can reliably determine the sex of a young chick, but does not know how she does it.  If asked, “How do you know that one is male?” the chicken-sexer can offer no reasons.  Still, for many it is quite plausible to say that the chicken-sexer knows the sex of the chick simply because, somehow, she is very successful in distinguishing males from females.  The point generalizes.  Many true beliefs held by very young people, who are less reflective than adults, and basic perceptually based beliefs even in adults, plausibly count as cases of knowledge because the processes from which those beliefs are formed allow the believer to distinguish what is true (for example, that the chick is male) from what is false (that the chick is female).  The externalist can account for these more easily than the internalist can, and such cases suggest that both the skeptic and the internalist may be setting the bar for knowledge too high.  For fuller discussion, see "Grandma, Timmy, and Lassie."

Finally, it is worthwhile to note further theoretical inspirations for process reliabilism.  One inspiration is epistemological naturalism— very roughly, the view that finding answers to epistemological questions requires more than just armchair inquiry, but also empirical investigation.  Some naturalists, for instance Quine (1969), will find this characterization too weak-kneed, arguing that armchair epistemological inquiry should be replaced by scientific investigation into what actually produces true beliefs.  Present purposes allow us to construe naturalism more broadly, because the crucial idea is that science can inform philosophy, which undermines the “traditional” idea of philosophy as providing the foundation of science.  (“Traditional” is in scare quotes because the history of philosophy prior to the twentieth century shows that the relationship between philosophy and science has not always been conceived of as that between foundation and superstructure.)  In particular, reliabilists look to cognitive science to understand the nature of our belief-forming processes and to tell us which among them are reliable.  Goldman himself is a leading figure in naturalistic epistemology, and has held joint appointments in philosophy and cognitive science.  Reliabilism intimately connects what previously were considered two distinct inquiries—the nature of cognition and the nature of knowledge.

3. Objections and Replies

a. Reliably Formed True Belief Is Insufficient for Justification

Perhaps the most basic objection to reliabilism is that reliably formed belief is not sufficient for justification.  Laurence BonJour (1980) has famously argued this point by way of counterexample.  Suppose S is reliably clairvoyant but has reason to believe there is no such thing as clairvoyance.  Still, on the basis of her clairvoyant powers, she believes truly that the President is in New York City.  Bonjour argues that S’s belief is not justified because S is being irrational—believing on the basis of a power she believes not to exist.  Goldman (1979) “replies” to this sort of problem (though Goldman’s paper came first) by tweaking his account of reliability.  For S’s belief that p to be justified, not only must it be produced by a reliable process, but there must be no other reliable process available to S such that, had S used that process, S would not believe that p.  Suppose S has scientific evidence that clairvoyance does not exist, scientific evidence typically being a reliable source of knowledge.  Had S based her belief on that evidence, it would override her clairvoyance-based belief, hence she would not believe that the President is in New York, supporting the conclusion that her actual belief is not in fact justified.

But what if, BonJour asks, S has no evidence in support of or against the existence of clairvoyance?  Then, there would be no other reliable process available to her such that, had her belief been based on it, she would not believe what she does.  In that case, S seems to believe blindly where, unlike typical perceptually based beliefs, she has no reason to think her clairvoyant powers are real.  A similar case is provided by Keith Lehrer (1990).  Mr. Truetemp has had a device implanted in his head, a “tempucomp”, which is an accurate thermometer “hooked up” to his brain in such a way that he automatically forms true beliefs about the ambient temperature but does not know anything about the thermometer.  Imagine that it was implanted while he was in the hospital for some other procedure.  Truetemp has reliably formed beliefs about the temperature, but does he know the temperature?  Here again, he appears to believe blindly, which seems irrational, hence unjustified.  A thoroughgoing externalist about knowledge may be willing to bite this bullet and say that S knows that the President is in New York (and that Truetemp knows the temperature), citing the reliability of the basis of the belief.  An externalist about justification might also bite this bullet and say that S’s belief is justified, but this seems to some a bit harder to swallow, since blind belief appears to undermine justification.

In Epistemology and Cognition (Goldman, 1986), Goldman suggested that a belief is justified if and only if it is reliable in normal worlds.  Normal worlds are those that are consistent with our most “general beliefs about the sorts of objects, events, and changes that occur in” the actual world (Goldman 1986, 107).  The suggestion addresses the benevolent demon and clairvoyance objections, and perhaps too the Truetemp objection, because none of those scenarios is consistent with our general beliefs about the actual world (though this is less clear for the Truetemp case).  Thus on the normal worlds approach, beliefs based on help from the demon, on clairvoyance, and on a thermometer implanted in one’s head “feeding” temperature data directly into one’s cognition would not count as genuinely reliable, and so are not justified.

As an account of when we would deem a belief justified, the normal worlds approach is promising, but one might wonder whether it is a plausible account of when one is actually justified.  After all, if our general beliefs about the actual world are not themselves justified, it would seem that beliefs formed against that backdrop are unjustified.  (See Pollock and Cruz (1999).)

Sensitive to this kind of objection, Goldman proposed yet another version of process reliabilism in his “Strong and Weak Justification” (Goldman, 1988).  The basic idea is that a belief is strongly justified when formed from a process that is actually reliable, but weakly justified when formed by a process that is deemed reliable (say, by one’s community). As we have seen, the two kinds of justification can come apart.  Imagine a community where astrology is deemed reliable and where an agent has no reason to believe that his community’s beliefs about which processes typically yield true beliefs are false or misguided.  Because the agent’s beliefs are blameless—she would not be faulted by her community peers for forming her astrology-based beliefs—there is a sense in which her beliefs are justified.  This is weak justification and is a plausible basis for when justification is properly attributed to an agent’s belief or believing.  But because astrology is not in fact reliable, she is not strongly justified.  On the other hand, reliably formed beliefs in the benevolent demon world, and beliefs formed from clairvoyance or from a tempucomp implanted in one’s head, are strongly justified.  However, because our community does not recognize such processes as actually reliable (or existent), such beliefs are not weakly justified.  In addition, one could view weak justification as an account of when it is proper to attribute justification, and strong justification as an account of when one is actually justified.  (Or, one could say that a belief is fully justified only if it is both strongly and weakly justified.)

Goldman subsequently offers another theory of justification attribution in “Epistemic Folkways and Scientific Epistemology” (Goldman, 1992), which proceeds in two stages.  In the first stage, an agent constructs a mental list based on her community’s beliefs about which processes are reliable.  Processes deemed reliable are thought of as virtuous, others as vicious.  In the second stage, the agent attributes justification only if a belief is virtuously formed— that is, formed according to whether the belief-forming process is on her list of virtues.  Most of us do not have clairvoyance or benevolent-helper-demon processes on our list of virtues, which explains why we do not attribute justification to beliefs formed on those bases.  Analogous to Goldman's earlier strong and weak distinction, here a belief is deemed justified only if formed from a process that appears on one’s list of virtues, but is actually justified only if formed from a process that is in fact reliable.  This discussion of the non-sufficiency objection to reliabilism reveals how accounting for de facto reliability and believed reliability make different demands on the theorist, requiring her to distinguish actual world reliable processes from processes that may not actually be reliable, but because they answer to our basic beliefs about what is reliable, they form the basis of our practices of attributing justification.

b. Reliably Formed True Belief Is Not Necessary for Justification

A second objection to reliabilism holds that reliably formed belief is not even necessary for justification.  Suppose there is a world where an evil demon furnishes people with false perceptions, such that their senses are unreliable bases of belief (Cohen, 1984; sometimes called ‘the New Evil Demon problem’).  In the actual world, many of our beliefs are justified on the basis of perception, and in the evil demon world, people’s perceptions are just like ours.  It would seem to follow that their beliefs are justified to the same extent as ours, in which case reliability is not necessary for justification.  Here again one can see the pressure exerted on reliabilist attempts to capture the intuitive notion of justification within an externalist framework.

Though the first and second objections to reliabilism are clearly distinct, the former challenging the sufficiency of reliably formed belief for justification, the latter the necessity of reliably formed belief, one or another of the strategies countenanced above to reply to the sufficiency objection may also help here.  Once one distinguishes the grounds for how we attribute justification from the grounds for when a belief is actually justified—believed reliability from factual reliability—one could say that in the new evil demon world, attributions of justification are appropriate because perception is believed to be reliable.  Goldman’s distinction between strong and weak justification can help here, as can his proposal in “Epistemic Folkways,” and perhaps even the normal worlds approach, because even in the demon world, we attribute justification to perceptually grounded beliefs because it is consistent with our general beliefs about that world.

c. The Problem of Easy Knowledge

A third problem which has stimulated much recent discussion charges reliabilism with illicit bootstrapping (or circularity), allowing knowledge (and justification) to be achieved too easily—the “problem of easy knowledge”.  (See, for example, Jonathan Vogel (2000) and Stewart Cohen (2002).)  Cohen is explicit that the concern about “easy knowledge” reaches beyond reliabilism; in fact, in the paper cited, he presents it as a worry for evidentialism as well.  Because the problem arises, according to Cohen, for any view with a basic knowledge structure—that is, in Cohen’s usage, any view which denies that one must know that one’s source of belief is reliable in order to obtain knowledge from that source—it is unclear to what extent reliabilism in particular is threatened by it.  (Cohen’s overall strategy is to force a dilemma: If one denies basic knowledge, insisting that a belief source must be known to be reliable in order for one to achieve knowledge from that source, skepticism becomes a threat.  This motivates a consideration of basic knowledge, which leads to the problem of easy knowledge.)

Cohen presents two versions of the problem.  One begins with the closure principle—that if S knows that p and S knows that p entails q, then S is in a position to know that q, via competent deduction from what she knows.  If a theorist makes space for basic knowledge, here’s an illustration of the problem.  S knows that the table is red on the (reliable) basis of its looking red and without having certified that what looks red usually is red—again, we begin with basic knowledge.  But S also knows that if the table is red, then it is not merely white and illuminated by red light, creating the red appearance, and by closure S knows the latter.  And if S knows that, it’s a short step from there to concluding that visual appearances are reliable indicators of the truth.  So from basic knowledge that does not require knowledge of the reliability of its source, we somehow obtain knowledge of the reliability of the source.  Could it really be that easy?  (No, it would seem.)

Here is Cohen’s other version, which echoes presentations of the problem by Vogel (2000) and Richard Fumerton (1995):

Suppose I have reliable color vision. Then I can come to know e.g. that the table is red, even though I do not know that my color vision is reliable. But then I can note that my belief that the table is red was produced by my color vision.  Combining this knowledge with my knowledge that the table is red, I can infer that in this instance, my color vision worked correctly.  By repeating this process enough times, I would seem to be able to amass considerable evidence that my color vision is reliable, enough for me to come to know my color vision is reliable (316).

This smacks of illicit bootstrapping because one’s only grounds for concluding that one's color vision is reliable are basic beliefs that, while by hypothesis de facto reliable, were never certified as such.  See Cohen’s paper and Peter Markie (2005) for two proposed solutions that incorporate basic knowledge.

d. The Value Problem for Reliabilism

A fourth problem for reliabilism has also received a lot of attention recently, namely, the value problem for reliabilism.  What the many forms of reliabilism have in common, as noted at the outset, is a concern to explicate the way in which knowledge and/or justification requires that beliefs are formed on a truth-conducive basis, highlighting the crucial link between belief and truth that constitutes knowledge.  The value problem begins with the thought, expressed in Plato’s Meno, that knowledge, whatever it is, is surely more valuable than mere true belief.  But given reliabilism’s exclusive focus on truth-conduciveness, it seems hard-pressed to explain why knowledge is more valuable than true belief.  After all, if one has a true belief, one already has what matters to the reliabilist, so how could it matter whether the belief is reliably formed?  How could that add any value?  Linda Zagzebski (2003) offers the following analogy.  If what you care about is a good cup of espresso (/truth), it does not matter to you, once you have it, whether it was made from a reliable espresso maker (/belief forming process) or not.  A good cup of espresso is not made better by having been reliably produced.

Here again, this problem plausibly extends to any theory of justification (or knowledge) where the crucial knowledge-constituting link between truth and belief is cast in truth-conducivist terms.  Zagzebski (2003, 16) argues this point, citing BonJour’s (1985) claim that “the basic role of justification is that of a means to truth.”  It is important here not to be misled by adjectives that indicate a positive evaluation of belief, like ‘justified’ and ‘reliable’ (or ‘reliably formed’).  One might easily think that being justified is a good thing, hence that a justified true belief is better than a mere true belief—a quick “solution” to the value problem.  But if justification is understood primarily as a means to truth, the implication is that truth is the source of value, and we’re back to the value problem: once an agent has true belief, she has what is valuable, so who cares how she got it?  So again, it’s not clear whether the reliabilist in particular needs a response.  That said, the reliabilist is not without resources.  Wayne Riggs (2002), although not a reliabilist, has argued that the added value of reliably formed belief might accrue to the agent insofar as it was to the agent’s credit that she formed a true belief.  When one achieves true belief unreliably, perhaps merely luckily, no such credit accrues to the agent.  A similar approach is to focus on the agent directly (as opposed to indirectly, through her reliable processes).  Roughly, when an agent forms true beliefs on the basis of good epistemic character traits or virtues, she is due credit, which explains the extra “goodness” accruing to knowledge over mere true belief.  This sort of position will be discussed further in section 4, below.

e. The Generality Problem

The final objection to reliabilism discussed herein—the previously mentioned generality problem—is especially thorny because it appears to imply that, even if it is conceded that reliability could be a plausible basis for justification and knowledge, the reliabilist project cannot succeed even on its own terms.  One begins to see the generality problem by noticing that every belief token is formed from a process that instantiates many types of process, and then wondering which process type is relevant to assessing reliability.  After all, on one way of individuating the relevant process, it may be truth-conducive (/reliable), whereas on another, it may not be truth-conducive (/may not be reliable).  “For example, the process token leading to my current belief that it is sunny today is an instance of all the following types: the perceptual process, the visual process, processes that occur on Wednesday, processes that lead to true beliefs, etc.  Note that these process types are not equally reliable.  Obviously, then, one of these types must be the one whose reliability is relevant to the assessment of my belief” (Feldman 1985, 159-60).  If the question about process type individuation cannot be answered independently of our basic judgments about when a belief is justified, reliabilism will not be a substantive, informative theory of justified belief.  (See also Conee and Feldman, 1998.)

Another way to understand the difficulty of the problem is to present it as a dilemma.  If processes are individuated too narrowly, the process will be applicable to only one instance of belief formation.  But then the reliability of the process will be determined simply by whether the one belief in question is true (because its truth ratio will be either horrible or impeccable), which is implausible.  If processes are individuated too widely, then every belief formed from the process will be deemed either reliable or unreliable, depending on the truth-conduciveness of that process, whereas, intuitively, some of those beliefs will be justified and others not.  Feldman dubs the former horn of the dilemma “the single case problem,” and the latter horn “the no-distinction problem” (Feldman 1985, 161).  A solution to the generality problem, then, requires a principled means of individuating processes that steers between the single case and the no-distinction problems, and which also plausibly answers to judgments about justification.

The generality problem has spawned a lot of philosophical work, and as of now it’s fair to say that there is no widely accepted solution to it.  Conee and Feldman (1998) provide a nice survey and critique of possible solutions, finding them wanting.  Since then a variety of new solutions have been proposed.  Mark Heller (1996) argues that the context of evaluation partly determines whether a process is rightly deemed reliable, hence that context is useful for individuating process types.  Juan Comesaña (2006) argues that any theory of justification needs to incorporate an account of the basing relation.  Recall the distinction between propositional and doxastic justification (from section 2).  Doxastic justification demands not only that one has adequate grounds for belief, or (for the reliabilist) not only that one possesses a process that would be reliable if used, but that the belief is actually based on those grounds or that reliable process. Comesaña argues that an adequate account of the basing relation can solve the generality problem, and because everyone owes an account of the basing relation, the reliabilist is in no worse shape than anyone else.  If that’s right, then perhaps the generality problem, like the bootstrapping and value problems, is not unique to reliabilism after all.

James Beebe (2004) proposes a two-stage approach to solving the generality problem.  The first stage narrows the field of relevant process types, including only those that: (i) solve the same type of information-processing problem as the token process at issue; (ii) use the same information-processing procedure; and (iii) share the same cognitive architecture.  Beebe notes that this still leaves a range of possible process types.  At the second stage, then, Beebe argues that we can further define the relevant process by partitioning the remaining candidate processes, concluding that “the relevant process type for any process token t is the subclass of [the candidates remaining from stage one] which is the broadest objectively homogeneous subclass of [the candidates] within which t falls.  A subclass S is objectively homogeneous if there are no statistically relevant partitions of S that can be effected” (Beebe 2004, 181).

Finally, Kelly Becker (2008) approaches the problem from the perspective of epistemic luck, and argues that an anti-luck epistemology requires both local and global (or process) reliability conditions.  Satisfying the local condition ensures that the truth of the acquired belief will not be due merely to some coincidental but fortuitous feature of the specific, actual circumstances in which the belief is formed.  (More on “local” reliabilism in section 5.)  The suggestion is that the local condition eliminates luck accruing to specific instances—single cases—of belief formation.  We are then free to characterize the relevant global process very narrowly, including in its description any and all features of the process that are causally operative in producing belief, short of implicating the specific content of the belief in the description.  We thereby avoid the no-distinction problem, given the specificity of the process description, and the single-case problem, since the process is repeatable, given that it is applicable to beliefs with contents other than the specific content of the target belief.

4. Proper Function and Agent and Virtue Reliabilism

There are relatives of process reliabilism that deserve mention in this article.  This section includes a discussion of global alternatives to process reliabilism, and the following section discusses local alternatives.  Because the central topic of this article is process reliabilism, these final two sections will be rather brief.

a. Plantinga’s Proper Function Account

Alvin Plantinga (1993) argues that not just any de facto reliable process provides a basis for justified belief.  For example, suppose S has a brain lesion that causes her to believe that she has a brain lesion, but she has no other evidence for that belief (and perhaps has some evidence against it).  Is her belief that she has a brain lesion warranted?  Plantinga thinks not, and concludes that a belief is warranted, hence constitutes knowledge, only if formed from a properly functioning cognitive process or faculty.  Because it is natural to suppose that the brain lesion case involves an improperly functioning process, one can conclude that S’s belief is unwarranted.

John Greco (2003) cites cases from Oliver Sacks that suggest that the proper function requirement is too strong.  One is the case of autistic twins with extraordinary mathematical abilities, another of “a man whose illness resulted in an increase in detail and vividness concerning childhood memory” (Greco 2003, 357).  If one wants to say that these are not improperly functioning faculties, then one might say the same about the brain lesion.  More plausibly, one would say that, like the brain lesion case, there is a reliable but improperly functioning process at work.  And because it is intuitively arbitrary, or just wrong, to say that the autistic twins are not warranted (or justified) in their mathematical beliefs, and that the man’s illness induced abilities cannot be the basis of warranted belief, it follows that the proper functioning of one’s cognitive processes is not required for warrant (/justification) and knowledge.

b. Agent and Virtue Reliabilism

Greco concludes that what really matters is whether belief is formed from a stable character trait, and this brings us to agent reliabilism.  One crucial insight here is that a true belief constitutes knowledge only if having achieved that true belief can be credited  to the agent.  This helps to eliminate the possibility that mere luck is responsible for one’s true belief, and it discounts very strange and fleeting processes as a basis for knowledgeable beliefs because they are not stable.  The brain lesion case might be such a fleeting process, if we imagine that there are lots of nearby worlds where it fails to produce true beliefs, whereas the Oliver Sacks cases involves processes that are not so susceptible to failure.

Ernest Sosa’s virtue reliabilism (1991 and 2007) bears an important similarity to Greco’s agent reliabilism.  The basis idea is that one knows that p only if one’s belief that p is formed from an epistemic virtue that reliably produces true belief.  S’s belief that p can be true but not based on an epistemic virtue, just as someone with little skill can sometimes make a shot in basketball.  S’s belief can be true and based on an epistemic virtue but not a case of knowledge because S does not achieve true belief because it was based on the epistemic virtue, just as a skilled shooter can make a basket even when the ball is partially blocked by a defender.  The shot is skillful—it demonstrates his basketball virtue—but it went in the basket because the trajectory was altered.  Finally, S’s belief that p can be true, based on an epistemic virtue, and true because based on that virtue.  Only then is the true belief a case of knowledge.  It is not just a matter of luck, as it is in the cases of the unskilled shooter and the skilled shooter whose shot is blocked.

With these distinctions in place, Sosa then distinguishes animal knowledge and reflective knowledge such that, roughly, animal knowledge is based on an epistemic virtue (say, on vision) and is thus reliably produced and non-accidental, whereas reflective knowledge is animal knowledge plus an understanding of how the bit of animal knowledge at issue came about.  That is, reflective knowledge requires metabeliefs about, among other things, how one’s target object-level belief was produced and how it coheres with one’s other object-level beliefs.  One potential problem here—and pretty much anywhere that meta-belief is introduced as a necessary condition—is the threat of regress.  If meta-belief is required to certify an instance of reflective knowledge, then what certifies that meta-belief?  A meta-meta-belief?  And if that question-and-answer is proper, then what principle can be presented to stop the question from being asked anew?  That is, what prevents us from rightly asking about the meta-meta-belief?

If we think of Greco’s stable character traits as epistemic virtues, then Greco’s and Sosa’s positions are both virtue epistemologies—they both say that knowledge is true belief formed from epistemically virtuous processes or faculties, and that it is to the agent’s credit that she has achieved true belief.  Virtue or agent reliabilism is also touted as the basis of a solution to the value problem for reliabilism, discussed above.  The idea is that knowledge is more valuable than true belief, but the added value is not in the belief itself, but “in” the agent, insofar as she deserves credit for her true belief.

5. Tracking and Anti-Luck Theories

This final section discusses local versions of reliabilism, whose aim is to develop an account of knowledge that eliminates knowledge-precluding epistemic luck.  Instead of focusing on the reliability of general processes with a view toward explicating justification, they focus on the specific belief at issue, together with the token method by which the belief is formed, and ask, “Though the belief is true, might it have easily been false?”  If “yes,” this is an indication that the belief is true partly by luck, and is thus not an instance of knowledge.  If the answer is “no,” then the belief, given the method by which it was formed, tracks the truth, is therefore not merely lucky, and is a case of knowledge.  Because the theories discussed in this section share process reliabilism’s commitments to externalism and fallibilism, and because these theories aim to explicate how knowledge requires more than an accidental connection between belief and truth—it requires a reliable link—they belong in the reliabilist family.

a. Sensitivity

Perhaps the most well-known, widely discussed, but also widely criticized tracking theory is Robert Nozick’s (1981) sensitivity theory.  Nozick presents two tracking conditions necessary for knowledge, both modalized— that is, both appealing to considerations about what would be the case in nearby possible worlds.  He calls the combination of the two conditions "sensitivity".

The first condition is variance: S knows that p only if, were p false, S would not believe that p. For example, suppose Smith believes truly that the cat is on the mat, but the method by which she forms the belief is tea-leaf reading.  On the plausible assumption that this method is not a good means to form true belief, if it were false that the cat is on the mat, Smith would believe it anyway, using her method.  She is just lucky to have actually achieved true belief, and thus does not know.

Second, adherence: S knows that p only if, were p true, S would believe that p.

Suppose Jones believes truly that today is Friday, but her method is to believe that it is Friday whenever Johnson wears a green shirt.  If Johnson had shown up wearing a red shirt on a Friday, Jones would believe that it is not Friday, violating the adherence condition.  Jones would have a lucky true belief, which is not a case of knowledge.

Somehow over the intervening three decades since Nozick’s book was published, the term "sensitivity" has come to apply just to the variance condition, which is arguably the most interesting and crucial of the two because it clearly establishes a discrimination requirement for knowledge—one knows that p only if one can discriminate the actual world where p is true from various close worlds where p is false.  (See also Dretske (1971) and Goldman (1976) for versions of a discrimination requirement that anticipate Nozick’s sensitivity.)  The ensuing discussion focuses on variance, which will be referred to as "sensitivity".

Sensitivity has faced numerous problems in the literature.  First, it appears to violate the very plausible principle that knowledge is closed under known entailment—that if S knows that p, and S knows that p entails q, then S is at least in a position to know that q (and would know that q if she deduced it from what she knows).  For example, suppose that S knows she is typing at her computer.  If it were false, she would not believe it based on her actual method of forming belief, which involves, say, at least vision, because she would be doing something else and would see that she’s not typing.  S knows, too, that if she is typing at her computer, then she is not a BIV.  Among other things, BIVs don’t have hands, so they cannot type.  It would seem that, by closure, S could simply deduce that she’s not a BIV.  But that belief is insensitive—by hypothesis, if S were a BIV, she would not believe that she is, because she would have exactly the same experiences she does in the actual world.  Closure failure. Tim Black (2002) argues for a version of Nozickean sensitivity that construes the methods by which one forms belief externalistically, thereby showing how sensitivity-based knowledge that one is not a BIV is possible, thus restoring closure. The basic idea is that one can know one is not a BIV because, in a BIV world, one’s method would be different than the method one uses in the actual world; in particular, BIV world beliefs are not really perceptual (because BIVs don’t have the normal sensory apparatus). Thus one’s actual perceptual method (on this construal of methods) would not lead one to believe, in a BIV world, that one is not a BIV. Some other method would or might do this, but not the actual method.

Second and third, it has been argued that sensitivity is incompatible with higher-level knowledge (Vogel, 2000)—knowledge that one knows—and with inductive knowledge (Vogel 2000; Sosa 1999).  Suppose that S knows that p.  Does she know that she knows that p, or even that she has a true belief that p?  Of course, many philosophers reject the thesis that knowledge requires knowing that one knows, but the objection is that sensitivity is incompatible with ever knowing that one knows.  Why?  Because if it were false that one knows that p, one would still believe that one knows that p.  (See Vogel for a precisely rendered version of this argument.  See Becker (2006a) for a counterargument meant to show how sensitivity is compatible with higher-level knowledge.)  Sensitivity is claimed to be incompatible with inductive knowledge because when one’s true belief is formed from reliable induction, there are nearby worlds where one’s inductive base is the same and so one forms the same belief, but the belief is false.  Sosa’s trash chute case is a widely cited example.  As I often do, I go to the trash chute to dump some garbage and believe that it will fall to the basement.  But if it were false that it will fall, I would still believe that it will fall.  Sosa argues that his preferred safety condition, the second of the two tracking conditions to be discussed herein, can handle inductive knowledge better than sensitivity.

A fourth problem for sensitivity is based on Timothy Williamson’s (2000) margins-for-error considerations.  Suppose Jones is six-foot-ten, and Smith believes that Jones is at least six feet tall.  If Jones were only five-foot-eleven-and-a-half inches tall, Smith might very well believe that Jones is at least six feet tall.  Smith is a decent judge of height, but not perfect.  Sensitivity is violated even though, intuitively, surely Smith knows that [the six-foot-ten] Jones is at least six feet tall.  The problem is that knowledge (or knowledgeable belief) requires a margin for error, and the sensitivity condition fails to account for this.  Williamson argues that the need for an error margin motivates a safety condition on knowledge.  Becker (2009) argues that, on a Nozickean construal of the methods by which one forms belief, Williamson’s counterexamples can be defanged.  The idea, applied to the present case, is to distinguish the method that Smith actually uses in coming to believe that Jones is at least six feet tall from the method that Smith would use in believing that Jones is at least six feet tall if Jones were only five-foot-eleven-and-a-half.  If the methods are distinct, then one can say that Smith would not believe, using her actual method, that Jones is at least six feet tall in the closest worlds where this is false, hence Smith actually knows that Jones is at least six feet tall.  And if the methods were not distinguishable, one might rightly argue that Smith is simply a terrible judge of height and does not know that Jones is at least six feet tall in the actual case.

b. Safety

There is another anti-luck condition receiving a lot of recent attention, and it was designed in large part as a response to the problems with sensitivity.  It is called "safety", and, like sensitivity, is sometimes cast in subjunctive terms, but often given a possible worlds construal.  Safety says that S knows that p only if, were S to believe that p, p would be true.  Alternatively put, S knows that p only if, in many, most, nearly all, or all nearby worlds (depending on the strength of the principle endorsed by the particular theorist) where S believes that p, p is true.  The anti-luck intuition at the heart of safety is that S knows that p only if S’s belief could not easily have been false.  That safety requires true belief throughout nearby worlds ensures this result.

Notice that safety sounds, on first hearing, like the contrapositive of sensitivity.  ("If S were to believe that p, p would be true" versus "If p were false, S would not believe that p.")  It is important to see that subjunctive conditionals do not contrapose, else the principles would be equivalent.  The difference can be illustrated by means of an example, which also serves to demonstrate one of the major advantages claimed for safety over sensitivity.  Take the proposition I am not a BIV (where "I" refers to the agent, S).  If that were false, by hypothesis, S would believe that it is true anyway, and therefore, according to the sensitivity principle, S does not know that she is not a BIV.  But in all the nearby worlds were S believes that she is not a BIV, it is true (assuming, of course, that the actual world is rather like we believe it to be).  So safety is compatible with knowledge that radical skeptical hypotheses are false, and in turn safety upholds the closure principle.  For example, S knows—has a safe belief—that she is typing at her computer, that this entails that she is not a BIV, and also that she is not a BIV.  Safety, then, promises a Moorean response to the skeptic, thereby achieving a stronger anti-skeptical result than sensitivity, and is not committed to obvious closure violations.

Sosa (1999) explains how safety overcomes the higher-level knowledge and inductive knowledge objections to sensitivity.  Suppose S knows that p.  Is safety compatible with S’s knowing that she knows that p?  Because her belief that p is safe, p is true in the nearby worlds where she believes that p.  Then, S’s belief that her belief that p is also safe, because the first-level belief is true throughout nearby worlds, and in those worlds, S believes that her first-level belief is true.  That is, S’s belief that q—her belief that p is true—is true throughout nearby worlds, because her belief that p is true is itself true throughout nearby worlds.

Safety also appears to be compatible with inductive knowledge.  In the previously mentioned trash chute case, S’s belief is safe because, in most nearby worlds where S believes that the garbage will fall to the basement, it is true.  John Greco (2003) questions this result by juxtaposing two cases.  In order to reconcile safety with inductive knowledge, the principle needs a somewhat weak reading: S’s belief is safe if and only if it is true throughout most nearby worlds.  On the other hand, in order to account for the intuition that one does not know that one’s lottery ticket will lose, safety requires a stronger formulation: S’s belief is safe if and only if it is true throughout all nearby worlds.  Why?  Because given the incredible odds against winning the lottery, say, 1 in 10 million, there are extremely few nearby worlds where one wins.  If we carry the strong reading over to the trash chute case, then it would seem that S’s belief is not safe.  After all, there are many nearby possible worlds where, for whatever reason, the bag does not fall to the basement.  Presumably, S would believe that the bag will fall anyway, and therefore her belief violates safety.

Duncan Pritchard (2005, chapter 6) argues that this conflict is illusory, and that paying close attention to the details of the cases described can resolve it.  “As Sosa describes [the trash chute case], there clearly isn’t meant to be a nearby possible world where the bag snags on the way down” (Pritchard 2005, 164).  Thus even the strengthened version of safety is claimed to be compatible with inductive knowledge in the trash chute case.  On the other hand, if there are nearby worlds where the bag gets snagged, then safety is violated, but in that case, perhaps it is correct to say that S does not knows that the bag will drop.

It is worth noting, too, that Pritchard’s path to endorsing the safety principle begins with his general characterization of luck, the central element of which is this: “If an event is lucky, then it is an event that occurs in the actual world but which does not occur in a wide class of the nearest possible worlds where the relevant initial conditions for that event are the same as in the actual world” (Pritchard 2005, 128).  Knowledge-precluding epistemic luck, then, occurs where one’s belief is true, but there are nearby worlds where her belief, formed in the same way as in the actual world, is false.  Thus Pritchard has a more general, independent motivation for safety than just a desire to overcome problems with sensitivity.

Timothy Williamson (2000) has also advocated safety.  One crucial consideration in his work is that knowledge, as we saw above in the discussion of sensitivity, requires a margin for error.  He argues that sensitivity does not always respect those margins.  (Recall the case of Smith’s belief that Jones [who is six-foot-ten] is at least six feet tall—if Jones were five-eleven-and-a-half, Smith (by hypothesis) would believe falsely that Jones is at least six feet tall, even though Jones knows in the actual case.)  Safety is designed with the need for an error margin in mind, precisely because it requires that S’s belief is true throughout nearby worlds.

One of safety’s central positive features also constitutes a potential problem for it—that it grounds the Moorean strategy for defeating the skeptic and thereby upholds closure.  For many philosophers, it is very difficult to see how a person could know she is not a BIV.  Putting the point in a way that perhaps sounds question-begging in favor of sensitivity, one might say that S simply cannot know that radical skeptical hypotheses are false because she would believe, for example, that she is not a BIV even if she were one—she simply cannot tell the difference between BIV worlds and normal worlds.  Whether one deems this a serious problem depends on whether one believes that knowledge always requires a capacity to discriminate worlds where p is true from worlds where p is false.  If one is not moved by any such discrimination requirement, one will not be moved by this objection.

See Becker (2006b) for a criticism of safety that does not hinge on discrimination per se, but which shows how safety is compatible with knowledge-precluding luck when a safe belief is formed by an unreliable belief forming process.  Sosa (2000, note 10) seems to have anticipated a similar concern: “what is required for a belief to be safe is not just that it would be held only if true, but rather that it be held on a reliable indication,” whereas Becker’s examples hinge on unreliably formed belief.  Whether the reliability requirement ought to be built into safety or added as a further necessary condition for knowledge is a separate issue.

This section provided an overview of the two main anti-luck tracking principles discussed in the contemporary literature.  Together with the preceding discussions of precursors to process reliabilism, process reliabilism itself, and close cousins, such as proper function theory and agent reliabilism, the reader should now be well-placed to investigate the varieties of reliabilism in some depth.

6. Conclusion

There are many possible motivations for a reliabilist account of knowledge: its naturalistic orientation makes it ripe for interdisciplinary investigation, particularly with cognitive science; its externalist underpinning makes possible both an account of unreflective knowledge and a strategy against the skeptic; its aim to elucidate a real link between belief and truth makes it a plausible basis for justification and suggests ways of handling knowledge-precluding luck.  Though reliabilism takes many forms, each focuses on the truth-conduciveness of the process or specific method through which belief is formed.  Reliabilism makes no antecedent commitment to traditional ideas about knowledge— for example, that one must have accessible reasons for belief, or that one must fulfill one’s epistemic duty to count as knowing— and therefore admits of more flexibility in its possible developments.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. 1973. Belief, Truth, and Knowledge (London: Cambridge University Press).
    • This is an early reliabilist account of knowledge, according to which knowledge requires a law-like connection between the state of affairs that p and one’s belief that p.
  • Becker, K. 2006a. “Is Counterfactual Reliabilism Compatible with Higher-Level Knowledge?” dialectica 60:1, 79-84.
    • Replies to Vogel’s (2000) argument that sensitivity is incompatible with knowing that one knows, or knowing that one has a true belief.
  • Becker, K. 2006b. “Reliabilism and Safety,” Metaphilosophy 37:5, 691-704.
    • Argues that safety (or any tracking principle) is insufficient, by itself, to eliminate knowledge-precluding luck due to faulty belief-forming processes.
  • Becker, K. 2008. “Epistemic Luck and The Generality Problem,” Philosophical Studies 139, 353-66.
    • Argues that there are two distinct sources of epistemic luck, so an anti-luck theory requires two distinct “reliability” conditions: one local, one global.  Together, the two conditions provide a basis for a solution to the generality problem.
  • Becker, K. 2009. “Margins for Error and Sensitivity: What Nozick Might Have Said,” Acta Analytica 24:1, 17-31.
    • Explains how, on a particular Nozickean conception of the methods by which an agent forms belief, sensitivity theorists can avoid Timothy Williamson’s counterexamples to sensitivity that are based on the plausible idea that knowledge requires a margin for error.
  • Beebe, J. 2004. “The Generality Problem, Statistical Relevance and the Tri-Level Hypothesis,” Noûs 38:1, 177-95.
    • Argues that the generality problem can be solved by appeal to the tri-level hypothesis for cognitive processing, which distinguishes three basis levels of explanation: computational, algorithmic, and implementation.
  • Bergmann, M. 2006. Justification Without Awareness (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • Defends externalism about justification, after presenting a dilemma for internalism—that it leads either to vicious regress or to skepticism.
  • Black, T. 2002. “A Moorean Response to Brain-in-a-vat Skepticism,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 80, 148–163.
    • Explains how, on an externalist conception of the methods by which one forms belief, Nozickean sensitivity can account for knowledge that radical skeptical hypotheses are false, which in turn can allow sensitivity theorists to uphold closure.
  • BonJour, L. 1980. “Externalist Theories of Empirical Knowledge,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 5, 53-73.
    • Argues that externalist theories of justification and knowledge are insufficient because one can have, say, reliably formed belief, but in some cases those beliefs will be irrational.
  • BonJour, L. 1985. The Structure of Empirical Knowledge (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
    • Presents a master argument against foundationalism, and then a dilemma for internalist foundationalists who appeal to “the given”, while arguing that externalism, as a plausible way out of the dilemma, fails to answer to our concept of justification.
  • Cohen, S. 1984. “Justification and Truth,” Philosophical Studies 46:3, 279-95.
    • Presents the New Evil Demon problem, which aims to show that one could have lots of justified beliefs, all of which are false.
  • Cohen, S. 2002. “Basic Knowledge and the Problem of Easy Knowledge,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXV:2, 309-29.
    • Presents two arguments to show that theories that allow basic knowledge—knowledge from a reliable source but where one need not know that the source is reliable—permit implausible bootstrapping from the basic source to achieve knowledge that the source itself is reliable.
  • Comesaña, J. 2006. “A Well-Founded Solution to the Generality Problem,” Philosophical Studies 129, 27-47.
    • Argues that any adequate epistemological theory requires an account of the basing relation, and that such an account can be the basis of a solution to the generality problem for reliabilism.
  • Conee, E. and Feldman, R. 1998. “The Generality Problem for Reliabilism,” Philosophical Studies 89, 1-29.
    • Formulates the generality problem for reliabilism and argues that proffered solutions extant in the literature fail to solve it.
  • Dretske, F. 1971. “Conclusive Reasons,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 49:1, 1-22.
    • Presents an account of knowledge-constituting reasons that anticipates Nozick’s variance condition (which has come to be known as sensitivity).
  • Feldman, R. 1985.  “Reliability and Justification,” The Monist 68:2, 159-74.
    • Formulates the generality problem for reliabilism in terms of a dilemma, where one horn is the single case problem, and the other horn is the no-distinction problem.
  • Feldman, R. and Conee, E. 1985. “Evidentialism,” Philosophical Studies 48, 15-34.
    • Offers an account of justification and well-foundedness in terms of the fit between one’s doxastic attitude and one’s evidence.
  • Fumerton, R. 1995.  Metaepistemology and Skepticism (Rowman & Littlefield, Lanham, MD).
    • Elicits relationships between metaepistemological topics, such as the analysis of knowledge, and skepticism, and argues that externalism fails to take skeptical concerns seriously.
  • Gettier, E. 1963. “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis 23:6, 121-2
    • Presents two widely accepted counterexamples to the tripartite analysis of knowledge as justified true belief.
  • Goldman, A. 1967. “A Causal Theory of Knowing,” Journal of Philosophy 64:12, 355-72.
    • Argues that knowledge requires a causal connection between an agent’s belief and the state of affairs that makes the belief true, partly motivated by Gettier’s counterexamples.
  • Goldman, A. 1976. “Discrimination and Perceptual Knowledge,” Journal of Philosophy 73:20, 771-91.
    • Argues that perceptual knowledge requires a capacity to distinguish the fact that p from close possibilities where p is false, anticipating Nozick’s sensitivity condition.
  • Goldman, A. 1979. “What Is Justified Belief?” in G. Pappas, ed. Justification and Knowledge (Dordrecht: D. Reidel), 1-23.
    • Aims to provide a substantive account of justification, in non-evaluative terms, by reference to reliable, that is, truth-conducive, belief-forming processes.
  • Goldman, A. 1986. Epistemology and Cognition (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
    • Continues and elaborates the reliabilist theory of justification.  Explains how thinking of reliability in terms of truth-conduciveness in “normal worlds” helps to answer the objection that (actual) reliably formed belief is insufficient for justification.
  • Goldman, A. 1988. “Strong and Weak Justification,” in J. Tomberlin, ed. Philosophical Perspectives 2, 51-69.
    • By distinguishing strong justification (as actually reliably formed belief) from weak justification (as believed reliably formed belief), replies to the objections that reliability is neither necessary nor sufficient for justification.
  • Goldman, A. 1992. “Epistemic Folkways and Scientific Epistemology,” Liaisons: Philosophy Meets the Cognitive and Social Sciences (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press), 155-75.
    • Offers a virtue-theoretic approach to understanding reliably formed belief, which in turn is the basis for justification.
  • Goldman, A. 2008. “Immediate Justification and Process Reliabilism,” in Q. Smith, ed. Epistemology: New Essays (Oxford: Oxford University Press), 63-82.
    • Argues that reliabilism is uniquely suited to account for basic beliefs—those not justified by reference to other beliefs—thereby permitting a foundational epistemology that is not threatened by a regress of reasons.
  • Greco, J. 2003. “Virtue and Luck, Epistemic and Otherwise,” Metaphilosophy 34:3, 353-66.
    • Argues that epistemic luck is better handled by agent reliabilism, where knowledge requires true belief acquired through the exercise of an agent’s character traits, than it is by extant versions of modal principles (like safety) or by proper function accounts.
  • Heller, M. 1995. “The Simple Solution to the Problem of Generality,” Noûs 29, 501-515.
    • Argues that the notion of reliability is context-sensitive, which provides a basis for a solution to the generality problem.
  • Klein, P. 1999. “Human Knowledge and the Infinite Regress of Reasons,” in J. Tomberlin, ed. Philosophical Perspectives 13, 297-325.
    • Argues that an infinite regress of reasons is not always vicious and thus infinitism is a better alternative to foundationalism and coherentism.
  • Kornblith, H. 2008. “Knowledge Needs No Justification,” in Q. Smith, ed. Epistemology: New Essays (Oxford: Oxford University Press), 5-23.
    • See the title.
  • Lehrer, K. 1990. Theory of Knowledge (Boulder: Westview Press).
    • His “Truetemp” example aims to show that reliably formed true belief is sufficient neither for justification nor for knowledge.
  • Markie, P. 2005. “Easy Knowledge,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXX:2, 406-16.
    • Aims to avoid the problem of easy knowledge for theories that allow basic beliefs to be justified, by distinguishing between when a belief is justified—say, the belief that one’s belief-forming process is reliable—and when that justification is of use against the skeptic.  We can bootstrap our way into the former justification, but it does not put us in a position to satisfy the skeptic.
  • Moser, P. 1989. Knowledge and Evidence (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
    • Presents a causal theory of the basing relation—of the reasons for which a belief is held.
  • Nozick, R. 1981. Philosophical Explanations (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press).
    • Epistemological concerns constitute less than one-fourth of this impressive book (which also includes discussions of metaphysics, ethics, and the meaning of life).  Nozick presents his subjunctive conditional, or ‘tracking’ theory, which includes his variance condition, now known simply as sensitivity.
  • Plantinga, A. 1993. Warrant and Proper Function (New York: Oxford University Press).
    • Argues that warrant—whatever it is that ties one’s belief to the truth, constituting knowledge—depends on the proper functioning of cognitive faculties.
  • Plato. Meno. (Many translations)
    • A dialogue on the nature of virtue and whether it can be taught.  The question of the value of knowledge is first presented here.
  • Plato. Theaetetus. (Many translations)
    • A dialogue on the nature of knowledge.  Near the end, Socrates considers the view that knowledge is true opinion or judgment with an account, closely related to the traditional tripartite analysis of knowledge as justified true belief, and finds it deficient.
  • Pollock, J. and Cruz, J. 1999. Contemporary Theories of Knowledge, 2nd edition (Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield).
    • Surveys contemporary epistemology and its problems.  Also presents a problem for Goldman’s ‘normal worlds’ approach to understanding reliability.
  • Pritchard, D. 2005. Epistemic Luck (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • Offers a general characterization of luck, in which terms epistemic luck is formulated.  Argues that epistemic luck is best eliminated by a safety condition on knowledge.
  • Quine, W.V. 1969. “Epistemology Naturalized,” Ontological Relativity and Other Essays (New York: Columbia University Press), 69-90.
    • Argues, largely on the basis of failed attempts to understand how philosophy can provide foundations for science, that science itself needs to be pressed into the service of answering philosophical questions.
  • Ramsey, F.P. 1931. “Knowledge,” in R.B. Braithwaite, ed. The Foundations of Mathematics and Other Essays (New York: Harcourt Brace).
    • Proposes the first version of a reliabilist account of knowledge.
  • Riggs, W. 2002. “Reliability and the Value of Knowledge,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 64:1, 79-96.
    • Argues that reliabilists can cite a source of value in reliably formed belief because the latter indicates credit due to the agent.
  • Sosa, E. 1991. Knowledge in Perspective (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
    • Presents a virtue-theoretic account of justification, where the concept of justification attaches primarily to beliefs formed from intellectual virtues, or stable dispositions for acquiring beliefs.
  • Sosa, E. 1991. 1999. “How to Defeat Opposition to Moore,” Philosophical Perspectives 13, 141-53.
    • Criticizes sensitivity on the grounds that it is incompatible with inductive and higher-level knowledge, and argues that safety better handles these kinds of knowledge and provides the basis for a neo-Moorean anti-skeptical strategy.
  • Sosa, E.. 2000. “Skepticism and Contextualism,” Philosophical Issues 10, 1-18.
    • Criticizes contextualism but, more importantly for present purposes, claims that safety must somehow be wedded to a “reliable indication” requirement to be sufficient, in addition to true belief, for knowledge.
  • Sosa, E.. 2007. A Virtue Epistemology: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge,Volume I (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • Distinguishes animal knowledge (apt belief) from adult human, or reflective knowledge, and takes a virtue-theoretic approach to both.
  • Steup, M. 2003. “A Defense of Internalism,” in L. Pojman, ed. The Theory of Knowledge, 3rd edition (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth), 310-21.
    • Defends internalism about justification, and characterizes internalism as the thesis that all factors that justify belief must be recognizable on reflection, thus discounting mere de facto reliability as justificatory.
  • Vogel, J. 2000. “Reliabilism Leveled,” The Journal of Philosophy 97:11, 602-23.
    • Criticizes both local and global versions of reliabilism.  Among other things, on the former, Vogel argues that sensitivity is incompatible with knowing that one has a true belief, and on the latter, presents the problem of easy knowledge.
  • Williamson, T. 2000. Knowledge and its Limits (New York: Oxford University Press).
    • Presents a wide range of novel theses about knowledge, including the claims that knowledge is a mental state, that it cannot be analyzed, and that it requires a margin for error, which prompts Williamson to argue for a version of safety.
  • Zagzebski, L. 2003. “The Search for the Source of Epistemic Good,” Metaphilosophy 34:1/2, 12-28.
    • Criticizes the machine-product model of knowledge on which reliabilism seems to depend for not being able to explain the unique value of knowledge.  Replaces this model with an agent-act model.

Author Information

Kelly Becker
Email: kbecker “at” unm “dot” edu
University of New Mexico
U. S. A.

Epistemic Circularity

An epistemically circular argument defends the reliability of a source of belief by relying on premises that are themselves based on the source. It is a widely shared intuition that there is something wrong with epistemically circular arguments.

William Alston, who first used the term in this sense, argues plausibly that there is no way to know or to be justified in believing that our basic sources of belief--such as perception, introspection, intuitive reason, memory and reasoning--are reliable except by using such epistemically circular arguments. And many contemporary accounts of knowledge and justification allow our gaining knowledge and justified beliefs by relying on such arguments. Indeed, any account that accepts that a belief source can deliver knowledge (or justified beliefs) prior to one's knowing (or believing justifiably) that the source is reliable allows this. It allows our knowing the premises of an epistemically circular argument without already knowing the conclusion, and using the argument for attaining knowledge of the conclusion. Still, we have the intuition that any such account makes knowledge too easy.

In order to avoid too easy knowledge via epistemic circularity, we need to assume that a source can yield knowledge only if we first know that it is reliable. However, this assumption leads to the ancient problem of the criterion and the danger of landing in radical skepticism. Skepticism could be avoided if our knowledge about reliability were basic or noninferential. It could also be avoided if we had some sort of "non-evidential" entitlement to taking our sources to be reliable. Both options are problematic.

One might think that we have to allow easy knowledge and some epistemic circularity because it is the only way to avoid skepticism. If we do so, however, we still need to explain what is then wrong with other epistemically circular arguments. One possible explanation is that they fail to be dialectically effective. You cannot rationally convince someone who doubts the conclusion of the epistemically circular argument, because such a person also doubts the premises. Another possible explanation is that such arguments fail to defeat a reliability defeater: if you have a reason to believe that one of your sources of belief is unreliable, you have a defeater for all beliefs based on the source. You cannot defeat this defeater and regain justification for these beliefs by means of epistemically circular arguments. Yet, there are still disturbing cases in which you do not doubt the reliability of a source; you are just ignorant of it. The present account allows your gaining knowledge about the reliability of the source too easily.

Thus there seems to be no completely satisfactory solution to the problem of epistemic circularity. This suggests that the ancient problem of the criterion is a genuine skeptical paradox.

Table of Contents

  1. Alston on Epistemic Circularity
  2. Epistemic Failure
  3. Easy Knowledge and the KR Principle
  4. Coherence and Reflective Knowledge
  5. The Problem of the Criterion
  6. Basic Reliability Knowledge
  7. Wittgenstein, Entitlement and Practical Rationality
  8. Sensitivity
  9. Dialectical Ineffectiveness and the Inability to Defeat Defeaters
  10. Epistemology and Dialectic
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Alston on Epistemic Circularity

When Descartes tried to show that clear and distinct perceptions are true by relying on premises that are themselves based on clear and distinct perceptions, he was quickly made aware that there was something viciously circular in his attempt. It seems that we cannot use reason to show that reason is reliable. Thomas Reid [1710-1796] (1983, 276) pointed out that such an attempt would be as ridiculous as trying to determine a man's honesty by asking the man himself whether he was honest or not. Such a procedure is completely useless. Whether he were honest or not, he would of course say that he was. All attempts to show that any of our sources of belief is reliable by trusting its own verdict of its reliability would be similarly useless.

The most detailed characterization of this sort of circularity in recent literature is given by William Alston (1989; 1991; 1993), who calls it "epistemic circularity." He argues that there is no way to show that any of our basic sources of belief--such as perception, intuitive reason, introspection, memory or reasoning--is reliable without falling into epistemic circularity: there is no way to show that such a source is reliable without relying at some point or another on premises that are themselves derived from that source. Thus we cannot have any noncircular reasons for supposing that the sources on which we base our beliefs are reliable. What kind of circularity is this?

Alston (1989; 1993, 12-15) takes sense perception as an example. If we wish to show that sense perception is reliable, the simplest and most fundamental way is to use a track-record argument. We collect a suitable sample of beliefs that are based on sense perception and take the proportion of truths in the sample as an estimation of the reliability of that source of belief. We rely on the following inductive argument:

At t1, S1 formed the perceptual belief that p1, and p1 is true.

At t2, S2 formed the perceptual belief that p2, and p2 is true.

.
.
.

At tn, Sn formed the perceptual belief that pn, and pn is true.

Therefore, sense perception is a reliable source of belief.

How are we to determine whether the particular perceptual beliefs mentioned in the premises are true? The only way seems to be to form further perceptual beliefs. Thus the premises of the track-record argument for the reliability of sense perception are themselves based on sense perception. The kind of circularity involved in this argument is not logical circularity because the conclusion that sense perception is reliable is not used as one of the premises. Nevertheless, we cannot consider ourselves justified in accepting the premises unless we assume that sense perception is reliable. Since this kind of circularity involves commitment to the conclusion as a presupposition of our supposing ourselves to be justified in accepting the premises, Alston calls it epistemic circularity.

Epistemic circularity is thus not a feature of the argument as such. It relates to our attempt to use the argument to justify the conclusion or to arrive at a justified belief by reasoning from the premises to the conclusion. In order to succeed, such attempts require that we be justified in accepting the premises. According to Alston, we cannot suppose ourselves to be justified in holding the premises unless we somehow assume the conclusion. He explains our commitment to the conclusion dialectically: "If one were to challenge our premises and continue the challenge long enough, we would eventually be driven to appeal to the reliability of sense perception in defending our right to those premises.¨ (1993, 15)

Surprisingly, Alston (1989; 1993, 16) argues that epistemic circularity does not prevent our using an epistemically circular argument to show that sense perception is reliable or to justify the claim that it is. Neither does it prevent our being justified in believing or even knowing that sense perception is reliable. This is so if there are no higher-level requirements for justification and knowledge, such as the requirement that we be justified in believing that sense perception is reliable. If we can have justified perceptual beliefs without already being justified in believing that sense perception is reliable, we can be justified in accepting the premises of the track-record argument and using it for attaining justification for the conclusion.

Alston does not suggest that there are higher-level requirements for knowledge and justification. His account of justification is a form of generic reliabilism that do not make such requirements. According to such reliabilism,

S's belief that p is justified if and only if it has a sufficiently reliable causal source.

If reliabilism is true, we can very well be justified in believing the premises of the track-record argument without being justified in believing the conclusion. It merely requires that the conclusion be, in fact, true. If sense perception is reliable along with other relevant sources--such as introspection and inductive reasoning--we can be justified in accepting the premises and thus arrive at a justified belief in the conclusion by reasoning inductively from the premises. Moreover, nothing prevents our coming to know the conclusion by means of such reasoning.

What, then, is wrong with epistemically circular arguments? This is what Alston states:

Epistemic circularity does not in and of itself disqualify the argument. But even granting this point, the argument will not do its job unless we are justified in accepting its premises; and that is the case only if sense perception is in fact reliable. This is to offer a stone instead of bread. We can say the same of any belief-forming practice whatever, no matter how disreputable. We can just as well say of crystal ball gazing that if it is reliable, we can use a track-record argument to show that it is reliable. But when we ask whether one or another source of belief is reliable, we are interested in discriminating those that can be reasonably trusted from those that cannot. Hence merely showing that if a given source is reliable it can be shown by its record to be reliable, does nothing to indicate that the source belongs to the sheep rather that with the goats. (1993, 17)

This is puzzling. Earlier Alston grants that, assuming reliabilism, we can use an epistemically circular track-record argument to show that sense perception is reliable. Now he is suggesting that such an argument shows at most the conditional conclusion that if a given source is reliable it can be shown by its record to be reliable. This seems merely to contradict the point he already granted.

We can make sense of this if we distinguish between two kinds of showing. When Alston talks about showing he usually has in mind something we could call "epistemic showing." Showing in this sense requires a good argument with justified premises. If we have such an epistemically circular argument for the reliability of sense perception, we can show the categorical conclusion that sense perception is reliable. Assuming that reliabilism is true and that sense perception, introspection and induction are reliable processes, the premises of the track-record argument are surely justified, and the justification of the premises is transmitted to the conclusion. If this is all that is required for showing, then epistemic circularity does not disqualify the argument.

There is another sense of showing, that of "dialectical showing." Showing in this sense is relative to an audience, and it requires that we have an argument that our audience takes to be sound, otherwise we would be unable to rationally convince it. If we assume that our audience is skeptical about the reliability of sense perception, it is clear that we cannot convince such an audience with an epistemically circular argument. This is so because the audience would also be skeptical about the truth of the premises. Assuming that our audience is skeptical only about perception and not about introspection and induction, we can only show to such an audience Alston's hypothetical conclusion: if sense perception is reliable, we can show--in the epistemic sense--that it is.

Whether this is what Alston has in mind or not, it is one possible diagnosis of the failure of epistemically circular arguments. Although they may provide justification for our reliability beliefs, they are unable to rationally remove doubts about reliability. They are not dialectically effective against the skeptic.

2. Epistemic Failure

The problem of epistemic circularity derives from our intuition that there is something wrong with it. Many philosophers have expressed doubts that this intuition is completely explained by dialectical considerations. The fault seems to be epistemic rather than just dialectical. Richard Fumerton (1995) and Jonathan Vogel (2000) argue that we cannot gain knowledge and justified beliefs by means of epistemically circular reasoning. They conclude that any account of knowledge or justification that allows this must be mistaken. Their target is reliabilism in particular. Fumerton writes:

You cannot use perception to justify the reliability of perception! You cannot use memory to justify the reliability of memory! You cannot use induction to justify the reliability of induction! Such attempts to respond to the skeptic's concerns involve blatant, indeed pathetic, circularity. Frankly, this does seem right to me and I hope it seems right to you, but if it does, then I suggest you have a powerful reason to conclude that externalism is false. (1995, 177)

If the mere reliability of a process is sufficient for giving us justification, as reliabilism entails, then we can use it to obtain a justified belief even about its own reliability. According to Fumerton, this counterintuitive result shows that reliabilism is false.

Vogel (2000, 613-623) giv