Category Archives: Epistemology

Ancient Greek Skepticism

Although all skeptics in some way cast doubt on our ability to gain knowledge of the world, the term "skeptic" actually covers a wide range of attitudes and positions. There are skeptical elements in the views of many Greek philosophers, but the term "ancient skeptic" is generally applied either to a member of Plato's Academy during its skeptical period (c. 273 B.C.E to 1st century B.C.E.) or to a follower of Pyrrho (c. 365 to 270 B.C.E.). Pyrrhonian skepticism flourished from Aenesidemus' revival (1st century B.C.E.) to Sextus Empiricus, who lived sometime in the 2nd or 3rd centuries C.E. Thus the two main varieties of ancient skepticism: Academic and Pyrrhonian.

The term "skeptic" derives from a Greek noun, skepsis, which means examination, inquiry, consideration. What leads most skeptics to begin to examine and then eventually to be at a loss as to what one should believe, if anything, is the fact of widespread and seemingly endless disagreement regarding issues of fundamental importance. Many of the arguments of the ancient skeptics were developed in response to the positive views of their contemporaries, especially the Stoics and Epicureans, but these arguments have been highly influential for subsequent philosophers and will continue to be of great interest as long as there is widespread disagreement regarding important philosophical issues.

Nearly every variety of ancient skepticism includes a thesis about our epistemic limitations and a thesis about suspending judgment. The two most frequently made objections to skepticism target these theses. The first is that the skeptic's commitment to our epistemic limitations is inconsistent. He cannot consistently claim to know, for example, that knowledge is not possible; neither can he consistently claim that we should suspend judgment regarding all matters insofar as this claim is itself a judgment. Either such claims will refute themselves, since they fall under their own scope, or the skeptic will have to make an apparently arbitrary exemption. The second sort of objection is that the alleged epistemic limitations and/or the suggestion that we should suspend judgment would make life unlivable. For, the business of day-to-day life requires that we make choices and this requires making judgments. Similarly, one might point out that our apparent success in interacting with the world and each other entails that we must know some things. Some responses by ancient skeptics to these objections are considered in the following discussion.

(Hankinson [1995] is a comprehensive and detailed examination of ancient skeptical views. See Schmitt [1972] and Popkin [1979] for discussion of the historical impact of ancient skepticism, beginning with its rediscovery in the 16th Century, and Fogelin [1994] for an assessment of Pyrrhonian skepticism in light of contemporary epistemology. The differences between ancient and modern forms of skepticism has been a controversial topic in recent years-see especially, Annas [1986], [1996], Burnyeat [1984], and Bett [1993].)

Table of Contents

  1. Academic vs. Pyrrhonian Skepticism
  2. Academic Skepticism
    1. Arcesilaus
      1. Platonic Innovator
      2. Attack on the Stoics
      3. On Suspending Judgment
      4. Dialectical Interpretation
      5. Practical Criterion: to Eulogon
    2. Carneades
      1. Socratic Dialectic
      2. On Ethical Theory
      3. On the Stoic Sage
      4. On Epistemology
      5. Practical Criterion: to Pithanon
      6. Dialectical Skeptic or Fallibilist?
    3. Philo and Antiochus
    4. Cicero
  3. Pyrrhonian Skepticism
    1. Pyrrho and Timon
    2. Aenesidemus
      1. Revival of Pyrrhonism
      2. The Ten Modes
      3. Tranquility
    3. Sextus Empiricus
      1. General Account of Skepticism
      2. The Path to Skepticism
      3. The Modes of Agrippa
      4. Skepticism vs. Relativism
      5. The Skeptical Life
  4. Skepticism and the Examined Life
  5. Greek and Latin Texts, Commentaries, and Translations
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Academic vs. Pyrrhonian Skepticism

The distinction between Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism continues to be a controversial topic. In the Second Century C.E., the Roman author Aulus Gellius already refers to this as an old question treated by many Greek writers (Attic Nights 11.5.6, see Striker [1981/1996]). The biggest obstacle to correctly making this distinction is that it is misleading to describe Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism as distinctly unified views in the first place since different Academics and Pyrrhonists seem to have understood their skepticisms in different ways. So even though the terms Academic and Pyrrhonian are appropriate insofar as there are clear lines of transmission and development of skeptical views that unify each, we should not expect to find a simple account of the distinction between the two.

2. Academic Skepticism

a. Arcesilaus

Following Plato's death in 347 B.C.E., his nephew Speusippus became head of the Academy. Next in line were Xenocrates, Polemo and Crates. The efforts of the Academics during this period were largely directed towards developing an orthodox Platonic metaphysics. When Crates died (c. 272 B.C.E.) Arcesilaus of Pitane (c. 318 to 243 B.C.E.) became the sixth head of the Academy. Another member of the Academy, Socratides, who was apparently in line for the position, stepped down in favor of Arcesilaus (Diogenes Laertius [DL] 4.32); so it seems he was held in high regard by his predecessors, at least at the time of his appointment. (See Long [1986] for discussion of the life of Arcesilaus.)

i. Platonic Innovator

According to Diogenes Laertius, Arcesilaus was "the first to argue on both sides of a question, and the first to meddle with the traditional Platonic system [or: discourse, logos] and by means of question and answer, to make it more of a debating contest" (4.28, translation after R.D. Hicks).

Diogenes is certainly wrong about Arcesilaus being the first to argue on both sides of a question. This was a long standing practice in Greek rhetoric commonly attributed to the Sophists. But Arcesilaus wasresponsible for turning Plato's Academy to a form of skepticism. This transition was probably supported by an innovative reading of Plato's books, which he possessed and held in high regard (DL 4.31).

Diogenes' remark that Arcesilaus "meddled" with Plato's system and made it more of a debating contest indicates a critical attitude towards his innovations. Diogenes (or his source) apparently thought that Arcesilaus betrayed the spirit of Platonic philosophy by turning it to skepticism.

Cicero, on the other hand, in an approving tone, reports that Arcesilaus revived the practice of Socrates, which he takes to be the same as Plato's.

"[Socrates] was in the habit of drawing forth the opinions of those with whom he was arguing, in order to state his own view as a response to their answers. This practice was not kept up by his successors; but Arcesilaus revived it and prescribed that those who wanted to listen to him should not ask him questions but state their own opinions. When they had done so, he argued against them. But his listeners, so far as they could, would defend their own opinion" (de Finibus 2.2, translated by Long and Sedley, 68J, see also de Natura Deorum 1.11).

Arcesilaus had (selectively) derived the lesson from Plato's dialogues that nothing can be known with certainty, either by the senses or by the mind (de Oratore 3.67, on the topic of Plato and Socrates as proto-skeptics, see Annas [1992], Shields [1994] and Woodruff [1986]). He even refused to accept this conclusion; thus he did not claim to know that nothing could be known (Academica 45).

ii. Attack on the Stoics

In general, the Stoics were the ideal target for the skeptics; for, their confidence in the areas of metaphysics, ethics and epistemology was supported by an elaborate and sophisticated set of arguments. And, the stronger the justification of some theory, the more impressive is its skeptical refutation. They were also an attractive target due to their prominence in the Hellenistic world. Arcesilaus especially targeted the founder of Stoicism, Zeno, for refutation. Zeno confidently claimed not only that knowledge is possible but that he had a correct account of what knowledge is, and he was willing to teach this to others. The foundation of this account is the notion of katalêpsis: a mental grasping of a sense impression that guarantees the truth of what is grasped. If one assents to the proposition associated with a kataleptic impression, i.e. if one experiences katalepsis, then the associated proposition cannot fail to be true. The Stoic sage, as the perfection and fulfillment of human nature, is the one who assents only to kataleptic impressions and thus is infallible.

Arcesilaus argued against the possibility of there being any sense-impressions which we could not be mistaken about. In doing so, he paved the way for future Academic attacks on Stoicism. To summarize the attack: for any sense-impression S, received by some observer A, of some existing object O, and which is a precise representation of O, we can imagine circumstances in which there is another sense-impression S', which comes either (i) from something other than O, or (ii) from something non-existent, and which is such that S' is indistinguishable from S to A. The first possibility (i) is illustrated by cases of indistinguishable twins, eggs, statues or imprints in wax made by the same ring (Lucullus 84-87). The second possibility (ii) is illustrated by the illusions of dreams and madness (Lucullus 88-91). On the strength of these examples, Arcesilaus apparently concluded that we may, in principle, be deceived about any sense-impression, and consequently that the Stoic account of empirical knowledge fails. For the Stoics were thorough-going empiricists and believed that sense-impressions lie at the foundation of all of our knowledge. So if we could not be certain of ever having grasped any sense-impression, then we cannot be certain of any of the more complex impressions of the world, including what strikes us as valuable. Thus, along with the failure to establish the possibility of katalepsis goes the failure to establish the possibility of Stoic wisdom (see Hankinson [1995], Annas [1990] and Frede [1983/1987] for detailed discussions of this epistemological debate).

iii. On Suspending Judgment

In response to this lack of knowledge (whether limited to the Stoic variety or knowledge in general), Arcesilaus claimed that we should suspend judgment. By arguing for and against every position that came up in discussion he presented equally weighty reasons on both sides of the issue and made it easier to accept neither side (Academica 45). Diogenes counts the suspension of judgment as another of Arcesilaus' innovations (DL 4.28) and refers to this as the reason he never wrote any books (4.32). Sextus Empiricus (Outlines of Pyrrhonism [generally referred to by the initials of the title in Greek, PH] 1.232) and Plutarch (Adversus Colotes 1120C) also attribute the suspension of judgment about everything to him.

Determining precisely what cognitive attitude Arcesilaus intended by "suspending judgment" is difficult, primarily because we only have second and third hand reports of his views (if indeed he endorsed any views, see Dialectical Interpretation below). To suspend judgment seems to mean not to accept a proposition as true, i.e. not to believe it. It follows that if one suspends judgment regarding p, then he should neither believe that p nor should he believe that not-p (for this will commit him to the truth of not-p). But if believing p just means believing that p is true, then suspending judgment regarding everything is the same as not believing anything. If Arcesilaus endorsed this, then he could not consistently believe either that nothing can be known or that one should consequently suspend judgment.

iv. Dialectical Interpretation

One way around this problem is to adopt the dialectical interpretation (advanced by Couissin [1929]). According to this interpretation, Arcesilaus merely showed the Stoics that they didn't have an adequate account of knowledge, not that knowledge in general is impossible. In other words, knowledge will only turn out to be impossible if we define it as the Stoics do. Furthermore, he did not show that everyone should suspend judgment, but rather only those who accept certain Stoic premises. In particular, he argued that if we accept the Stoic view that the Sage never errs, and since katalepsis is not possible, then the Sage (and the rest of us insofar as we emulate the Sage) should never give our assent to anything. Thus the only way to achieve sagehood, i.e. to consistently avoid error, is to suspend judgment regarding everything and never risk being wrong (Lucullus 66-67, 76-78, see also Sextus Empiricus, Against the Logicians [generally referred to by the initial M, for the name of the larger work from which it comes,Adversus Mathematikos] 7.150-57). But the dialectical Arcesilaus himself neither agrees nor disagrees with this.

v. Practical Criterion: to Eulogon

The biggest obstacle to the dialectical interpretation is Arcesilaus' practical criterion, to eulogon. Arcesilaus presented this criterion in response to the Stoic objection that if we were to suspend judgment regarding everything, then we would not be able to continue to engage in day to day activities. For, theStoics thought, any deliberate action presupposes some assent, which is to say that belief is necessary for action. Thus if we eliminate belief we will eliminate action (Plutarch, Adversus Colotes 1122A-F, LS 69A).

Sextus remarks that

inasmuch as it was necessary . . . to investigate also the conduct of life, which cannot, naturally, be directed without a criterion, upon which happiness-that is, the end of life-depends for its assurance, Arcesilaus asserts that he who suspends judgment about everything will regulate his inclinations and aversion and his actions in general by the rule of "the reasonable [to eulogon]," and by proceeding in accordance with this criterion he will act rightly; for happiness is attained by means of wisdom, and wisdom consists in right actions, and the right action is that which, when performed, possesses a reasonable justification. He, therefore, who attends to "the reasonable" will act rightly and be happy (M 7.158, translated by Bury).

There is a good deal of Stoic technical terminology in this passage, including the term eulogon itself, and this may seem to support the dialectical interpretation. On this view, Arcesilaus is simply showing the Stoics both that their account of knowledge is not necessary for virtue, and that they nonetheless already have a perfectly acceptable epistemic substitute, to eulogon (see Striker [1980/1996]). But this raises the question, why would Arcesilaus make such a gift to his Stoic adversaries? It would be as if, Maconi's words, "Arcesilaus first knocked his opponent to the ground and then gave him a hand up again" (1988: 248). Such generosity would seem to be incompatible with the purely dialectical purpose of refutation. Similarly, if he had been arguing dialectically all along, there seems to be no good reason for him to respond to Stoic objections, for he was not presenting his own views in the first place. On the other hand, the proponent of the dialectical view could maintain that Arcesilaus has not done any favors to the Stoics by giving them the gift of to eulogon; rather, this "gift" may still be seen as a refutation of the Stoic view that a robust knowledge is necessary for virtue.

An alternative to the dialectical view is to interpret to eulogon as Arcesilaus' own considered opinion regarding how one may live well in the absence of certainty. This view then encounters the earlier difficulty of explaining how it is consistent for Arcesilaus to endorse suspending judgment on all matters while at the same time believing that one may attain wisdom and happiness by adhering to his practical criterion.

b. Carneades

Arcesilaus was succeeded by Lacydes (c. 243 B.C.E.), and then Evander and Hegesinus in turn took over as heads of the Academy. Following Hegesinus, Carneades of Cyrene (c. 213 to 129 B.C.E.), perhaps the most illustrious of the skeptical Academics, took charge. Rather than merely responding to the dogmatic positions that were currently held as Arcesilaus did, Carneades developed a wider array of skeptical arguments against any possible dogmatic position, including some that were not being defended. He also elaborated a more detailed practical criterion, to pithanon. As was the case with Arcesilaus, he left nothing in writing, except for a few letters, which are no longer extant (DL 4.65).

i. Socratic Dialectic

Carneades employed the same dialectical strategies as Arcesilaus (Academica 45, Lucullus 16), and similarly found his inspiration and model in Plato's Socrates. The Socratic practice which Carneades employed, according to Cicero, was to try to conceal his own private opinion, relieve others from deception and in every discussion to look for the most probable solution (Tusculan Disputations 5.11, see also de Natura Deorum 1.11).

In 155 B.C.E., nearly one hundred years after Arcesilaus' death in 243, Carneades is reported to have gone as an Athenian ambassador to Rome. There he presented arguments one day in favor of justice and the next he presented arguments against it. He did this not because he thought that justice should be disparaged but rather to show its defenders that they had no conclusive support for their view (Lactantius, LS 68M). Similarly, we find Carneades arguing against the Stoic conception of the gods, not in order to show that they do not exist, but rather to show that the Stoics had not firmly established anything regarding the divine (de Natura Deorum 3.43-44, see also 1.4). It seems then that Carneades was motivated primarily by the Socratic goal of relieving others of the false pretense to knowledge or wisdom and that he pursued this goal dialectically by arguing both for and against philosophical positions.

ii. On Ethical Theory

But whereas Arcesilaus seemed to limit his targets to positions actually held by his interlocutors, Carneades generalized his skeptical attack, at least in ethics and epistemology. The main task of Hellenistic ethics was to determine the summum bonum, the goal at which all of our actions must aim if we are to live good, happy lives. Carneades listed all of the defensible candidates, including some that had not actually been defended, in order to argue for and against each one and show that no one in fact knows what the summum bonum is, if indeed there is one (de Finibus 5.16-21). He may have even intended the stronger conclusion that it is not possible to acquire knowledge of the summum bonum,assuming his list was exhaustive of all the serious candidates.

iii. On the Stoic Sage

As with Arcesilaus, Carneades also focused much of his skeptical energy on the Stoics, particularly the views of the scholarch Chrysippus (DL 4.62). The Stoics had developed a detailed view of wisdom as life in accordance with nature. The Stoic sage never errs, he never incorrectly values the goods of fortune, he never suffers from pathological emotions, and he always remains tranquil. His happiness is completely inviolable since everything he does and everything he experiences is precisely as it should be; and crucially, he knows this to be true. Even though the Stoics were extremely reluctant to admit that anyone had so far achieved this extraordinary virtue, they nonetheless insisted that it was a real possibility (Luc.145, Tusc. 2.51, Seneca Ep. 42.1, M 9.133, DL 7.91).

As a dialectician, Carneades carefully examined this conception of the sage. Sometimes he argued, contrary to the Stoic view, that the sage would in fact assent to non-kataleptic impressions and thus that he was liable to error (Luc. 67); for he might form opinions even in the absence of katalepsis (Luc. 78). But he also apparently argued against the view that the sage will hold mere opinions in the absence of katalepsis (Luc. 112). Presumably he didn't himself endorse either position since the issue that had to be decided first was whether katalepsis was even possible. In other words, if certainty is possible, then of course the sage should not settle for mere opinion. But if it is not possible, then perhaps he will be entitled to hold mere opinions, provided they are thoroughly examined and considered.

iv. On Epistemology

Just as Carneades generalized his skeptical attack on ethical theories, he also argued against all of his predecessors' epistemological theories (M 7.159). The main task of Hellenistic epistemology was to determine the criterion (standard, measure or test) of truth. If the criterion of truth is taken to be a sort of sense-impression, as in the Stoic theory, then we will not be able to discover any such impression that could not in principle appear true to the most expertly trained and sensitive perceiver and yet still be false (M 7.161-65, see Arcesilaus' "Attack on the Stoics" above). But if we can discover no criterial sense-impression, then neither will the faculty of reason alone be able to provide us with a criterion, insofar as we accept the empiricist view (common among Hellenistic philosophers) that nothing can be judged by the mind that hasn't first entered by the senses.

We have no evidence to suggest that Carneades also argued against a rationalist, or a priori approach to the criterion.

v. Practical Criterion: to Pithanon

According to Sextus, after arguing against all the available epistemological theories, Carneades himself needed to advance a criterion for the conduct of life and the attainment of happiness (M 7.166). Sextus does not tell us why it was necessary for Carneades to do so, but it was probably for the same reason that Arcesilaus had presented his practical criterion-namely, in response to the objection that if there were no epistemic grounds on which to prefer one impression over another then, despite all appearances, we cannot rationally govern our choices. Thus, Carneades expounded his practical criterion, to pithanon.

First he noted that every sense impression exists in two distinct relations: one relative to the object from which it comes, the "impressor", and the other relative to the perceiver. The first relation determines what we ordinarily think of as truth: does the impression correspond to its object or not? The second relation determines plausibility: is the impression convincing to the perceiver or not? Rather than relying on the first relation, Carneades adopted the convincing impression [pithanê phantasia] as the criterion of truth, even though there will be occasions on which it fails to accurately represent its object. Yet, he apparently thought that these occasions are rare and so they do not provide a good reason for distrusting the convincing impressions. For such impressions are reliable for the most part, and in actual practice, life is regulated by what holds for the most part (M 7.166-75, LS 69D).

Sextus also reports the refinements Carneades made to his criterion. If we are considering whether we should accept some impression as true, we presumably have already found it to be convincing, but we should also consider how well it coheres with other relevant impressions and then thoroughly examine it further as if we were cross-examining a witness. The amount of examination that a convincing impression requires is a function of its importance to us. In insignificant matters we make use of the merely convincing impression, but in weighty matters, especially those having to do with happiness, we should only rely on the convincing impressions that have been thoroughly explored (M 7.176-84).

Cicero translates Carneades' pithanon with the Latin terms probabile and veri simile, and he claims that this criterion is to be employed both in everyday life and in the Academic dialectical practice of arguing for and against philosophical views (Luc. 32, see also Contr.Ac. 2.26, and Glucker [1995]). The novel feature of this criterion is that it does not guarantee that whatever is in accordance with it is true. But if it is to play the dialectical role explicitly specified by Cicero and suggested by Sextus' report, then it must have some connection with truth. This is especially clear in the case of sense-impressions: the benefit of thoroughly examining sense-impressions is that we may rule out the deceptive ones and accept the accurate ones. And we may make a similar case, as Cicero does, for the dialectical examination of philosophical views. A major difficulty in interpreting Carneades' pithanon in this way is that it requires some explanation for how we are able to identify what resembles the truth (veri simile) without being able to identify the truth itself (Luc. 32-33).

vi. Dialectical Skeptic or Fallibilist?

Even if the fallibilist interpretation of Carneades' criterion is correct, it remains a further issue whether he actually endorsed his criterion himself, or whether he merely developed it dialectically as a possible view. Indeed, even Carneades' student Clitomachus was unable to determine what, if anything, Carneades endorsed (Luc. 139, see also Striker [1980/1996]). A number of difficulties arise if he did endorse his criterion. First, Carneades argued that there is absolutely no criterion of truth (M 7.159) and that would presumably include to pithanon. Second, Clitomachus claims that Carneades endured a nearly Herculean labor "when he cast assent out of our minds, like a wild and savage beast, that is mere opinion and thoughtlessness" (Luc. 108). Thus it would seem to be inconsistent for him to accept a moderate, fallible form of assent if it leads to holding opinions.

We may more simply deal with Carneades' criterion by noting that sometimes he argued so zealously in support of some view that people reasonably, but incorrectly, assumed that he accepted it himself (Luc.78, Fin. 5.20). Thus we may say that Carneades only advanced views dialectically but remained uncommitted to any of them. His criterion in this case would be the disappointing consequence of Stoic epistemological commitments-disappointing (as in the case with the dialectical reading of Arcesilaus'eulogon) because the Stoics believed these same commitments led to a much more robust criterion.

On the other hand, Cicero endorses a fallibilist interpretation of to pithanon which he seems to think was also endorsed by Carneades himself. This interpretation was developed by another of Carneades' students, Metrodorus, and by Cicero's teacher, Philo. We also have evidence that Carneades made an important distinction between assent and approval that he may have appealed to in this context (Luc. 104, see Bett [1990]). He limits assent to the mental event of taking a proposition to be true and adopts the term "approval" for the more modest mental event of taking a proposition to be convincing but without making any commitment to its truth. If this distinction is viable it would allow Carneades to approve of his epistemological criterion without committing himself at any deeper theoretical level. In other words Carneades could appeal to his criterion for his very adoption of that criterion: it is pithanon but not certain that to pithanon is the criterion for determining what we should approve of. Cicero claims that Carneades made just this sort of move in the case of his rejection of the possibility of Stoic katalepsis: it isprobabile (= pithanon), but not certain, that katalepsis is not possible (Luc. 110, see Thorsrud [2002]).

c. Philo and Antiochus

According to Sextus Empiricus, most people divide the Academy into three periods: the first, the so-called Old Academy, is Plato's; the second is the Middle Academy of Arcesilaus; and the third is the New Academy of Carneades. But, he remarks, some also add a fourth Academy, that of Philo, and a fifth Academy, Antiochus' (PH 1.220). Philo was head of the Academy from about 110 to 79 B.C.E. His interpretation of Academic skepticism as a mitigated form that permits tentative approval of the view that survives the most dialectical scrutiny is recorded and examined in Cicero's Academica, and in the earlier version of this dialogue, the Lucullus. The Lucullus is just one of the two books that constituted the earlier version. The second book, now lost was called Catulus, after one of the main speakers. Cicero later revised these books, dividing them into four; but only part of the first of those four, what is usually referred to as the Academica posteriora, has survived. Nevertheless, we have enough of these books to get a pretty good sense of the whole work (see Griffin [1997], Mansfeld [1997]).

Philo apparently claimed that some sense-impressions very well may be true but that we nonetheless have no reliable way to determine which ones these are (Luc. 111, see also 34). Similarly, Sextus attributes to Philo the view that "as far the Stoic standard (i.e. apprehensive appearance [= kataleptic impression]) is concerned, objects are inapprehensible, but as far as the nature of the objects themselves is concerned they are apprehensible" (PH 1.235, translated by Annas and Barnes). He may have made these remarks in order to underwrite the Academic practice of accepting certain views as resembling the truth; for there must be some truth in the first place-even if we don't have access to it-in order for something to resemble it.

Under the pressure of Stoic objections to his fallibilist epistemology Philo apparently made some controversial innovations in Academic philosophy. Cicero refers to these innovations but doesn't discuss them in any detail (Luc. 11-12), nor did he accept them himself, preferring Philo's earlier view of the Academy and the dialectical practices of Carneades. Philo's innovation may have been to commit himself to the metaphysical claim that some impressions are indeed true by providing arguments to that effect. So rather than rely on the likelihood that some impressions are true he may have sought to establish this more firmly. He then may have lowered the standard for knowledge by giving up the internalist requirement that one be able to identify which impressions are true and adopted instead the externalist position that just having true impressions, as long as they have the right causal history, is enough for one to have knowledge (see Hankinson [1997] for this interpretation, see also Tarrant [1985] and Brittain [2001]).

After Philo, Antiochus (c. 130 to c. 68 B.C.E.) led the Academy decidedly back to a form of dogmatism. He claimed that the Stoics and Peripatetics had more accurately understood Plato and thus he sought to revive these views, including primarily Stoic epistemology and ethics, in his Academy (Cicero examines Antiochus' views in de Finibus 5. Glucker [1978] is a groundbreaking study of Antiochus.).

d. Cicero

Cicero was a lifelong student and practitioner of Academic philosophy and his philosophical dialogues are among the richest sources of information about the skeptical Academy. Although he claims to be a mere reporter of other philosophers' views (Att. 12.52.3), he went to some trouble in arranging these views in dialogue form and most importantly in supplying his own words to express them. In some cases he coined the words he needed thereby teaching philosophy to speak Latin. His philosophical coinages-e.g.essentia, qualitas, beatitudo-have left a lasting imprint on Western philosophy.

He is generally not considered to be an original thinker but it is difficult to determine the extent to which this is true since practically none of the books he relied on have survived and so we do not know how much, or whether, he modified the views he presented. Nevertheless, despite questions of originality, his dialogues express a humane and intelligent view of life. Plutarch, in his biography, claims that Cicero often asked his friends to call him a philosopher because he had chosen philosophy as his work, but merely used oratory to achieve his political ends (Life of Cicero 32.6, Colish [1985] is a comprehensive survey of Cicero's philosophical dialogues, so too MacKendrick [1989], and see Powell [1995] for more recent essays on Cicero's philosophy).

3. Pyrrhonian Skepticism

Pyrrho of Elis (c. 360 to c. 270 BCE), the founder of Pyrrhonian skepticism, is a shadowy figure who wrote nothing himself. What little we know of him comes, for the most part, from fragments of his pupil Timon's poems and from Diogenes Laertius' biography (9.61-108) which is based on a book by Antigonus of Carystus, an associate of Timon. There seem to have been no more disciples of Pyrrho after Timon, but much later in the 1st Century B.C.E., Aenesidemus proposed a skeptical view that he claimed to be Pyrrhonian. Later still in the 2nd Century C.E., Sextus Empiricus recorded a battery of skeptical arguments aimed at all contemporary philosophical views. As with Aenesidemus, Sextus claimed Pyrrho as the founder, or at least inspiration, for the skepticism he reports. The content of these skeptical views, the nature of Pyrrho's influence, and the relations between succeeding stages of Pyrrhonism are controversial topics.

a. Pyrrho and Timon

The anecdotal evidence for Pyrrho tends to be sensational. Diogenes reports, for example, that Pyrrho mistrusted his senses to such an extent that he would have fallen off cliffs or been run over by carts and savaged by dogs had his friends not followed close by (9.62). He was allegedly indifferent to certain norms of social behavior, taking animals to market, washing a pig and even cleaning the house himself (9.66). For the most part we find his indifference presented as a positive characteristic. For example, while on a ship in the midst of a terrible storm he was able to maintain a state of tranquility (9.68). Similarly, Timon presents Pyrrho as having reached a godlike state of calm, having escaped servitude to mere opinion (9.64-5, see also the fragments of Timon's prose works, as recorded by Aristocles, LS 2A and 2B). He was also held in such high regard by his native city that he was appointed as high priest and for his sake they made all philosophers exempt from taxation (9.64). We also find a tantalizing report of a journey to India where Pyrrho mingled with, and presumably learned from, certain naked sophists and magi (9.61, the connection with Indian Buddhism is explored by Flintoff [1980]).

Generally, the anecdotal evidence in Diogenes, and elsewhere, is unreliable, or at least highly suspect. Such reports are more likely colorful inventions of later authors attributed to Pyrrho to illustrate, or caricature, some part of his philosophical view. Nevertheless, he is consistently portrayed as being remarkably calm due to his lack of opinion, so we may cautiously accept such accounts.

The most important testimony to the nature of Pyrrho's skepticism comes from Aristocles, a Peripatetic philosopher of the 2nd Century C.E.:

It is supremely necessary to investigate our own capacity for knowledge. For if we are so constituted that we know nothing, there is no need to continue enquiry into other things. Among the ancients too there have been people who made this pronouncement, and Aristotle has argued against them. Pyrrho of Elis was also a powerful spokesman of such a position. He himself has left nothing in writing, but his pupil Timon says that whoever wants to be happy must consider these three questions: first, how are things by nature? Secondly, what attitude should we adopt towards them? Thirdly, what will be the outcome for those who have this attitude? According to Timon, Pyrrho declared that [1] things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable. For this reason [2] neither our sensations nor our opinions tell us truths or falsehoods. Therefore, for this reason we should not put our trust in them one bit, but we should be unopinionated, uncommitted and unwavering, saying concerning each individual thing that it no more is than is not, or it both is and is not, or it neither is nor is not. [3] The outcome for those who actually adopt this attitude, says Timon, will be first speechlessness, and then freedom from disturbance . . . (Aristocles apudEusebius, Praeparatio evangelica 14.18.1-5, translated by Long and Sedley, 1F).

Let us consider Pyrrho's questions and answers in order. First, what are things like by nature? This sounds like a straightforward metaphysical question about the way the world is, independent of our perceptions. If so, we should expect Pyrrho's answer, [1] that things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable, to be a metaphysical statement. But this will lead to difficulties, for how can Pyrrho arrive at the apparently definite proclamation that things are indefinite? That is, doesn't his metaphysical statement refute itself by implicitly telling us that things are decidedly indeterminate? If we take this view we may defend Pyrrho by allowing his claim to be exempt from its own scope-so we can determine only this much: every property of every thing is indeterminate (see Bett [2000] for this defense). Alternatively, we may allow Pyrrho to embrace the apparent inconsistency and assert that his claim is itself neither true nor false, but is inarbitrable. The former option seems preferable insofar as the latter leaves Pyrrho with no definite assertion whatsoever and it thus becomes unclear how he could draw the inferences he does from [1] to [2].

On the other hand, we may seek to avoid these difficulties by interpreting Pyrrho's first answer as epistemological. After all, the predicates he uses suggest an epistemological claim is being made. And further, Aristocles introduces this passage by noting that we must investigate our capacity for knowledge and he claims that Pyrrho was a spokesman for the view that we know nothing. Bett [2000] argues against the epistemological reading on the grounds that it doesn't make good sense of the passage as it stands. For if we assume the epistemological reading of [1], that we are unable to determine the natures of things, then it would be pointless to infer from that that [2] our senses lie. It would make much more sense to reverse the inference: one might reasonably argue that our senses lie and thus we are unable to determine the natures of things. Some have proposed emending the text from "for this reason (dia touto)" to "on account of the fact that (dia to)" to capture this reversal of the inference. But if we read the text as it stands, we may still explain Aristocles' epistemological focus by pointing out that if [1] things are indeterminate, then the epistemological skepticism will be a consequence: things are indeterminable.

Second, in what way ought we to be disposed towards things? Since things are indeterminate (assuming the metaphysical reading) then no assertion will be true, but neither will any assertion be false. So we should not have any opinion about the truth or falsity of any statement (with the exception perhaps of these meta-level skeptical assertions). Instead, we should only say and think that something no more is than is not, or both is and is not, or neither is nor is not, because in fact that's the way things are. So for example, having accepted [1] (and assuming the predicative reading of "is" in [2]), I will no longer believe that this book is red, but neither will I believe that it is not red. The book is no more red than not-red, or similarly, it is as much red as not-red.

Third, what will be the result for those who are so disposed? The first result is speechlessness (literally, not saying anything)-but this is odd given that we are encouraged to adopt a form of speech in [2]. Perhaps speechlessness follows after initially saying only that things are no more this than that, etc.; then finally, freedom from disturbance follows. Presumably, the recognition that things are no more to be sought after than not sought after is instrumental in producing tranquility, for if nothing is intrinsically good or bad, we have no reason to ever be distressed, or to be exuberantly joyful. But then it seems we would not be able to even choose one thing over another. Pyrrho's tranquility thus begins to look like a kind of paralysis and this is probably what prompted some of the sensational anecdotes.

Diogenes notes, however, that according to Aenesidemus, Pyrrho exercised foresight in his day-to-day activities, and that he lived to be ninety (9.62). So it seems his tranquility did not paralyze him after all. This may be either because Pyrrho (or Timon) was disingenuous about what he was up to intellectually, or more charitably because he followed appearances (9.106) without ever committing himself to the truth or falsity of what appeared. (See "Sextus on the skeptical life" below for further discussion).

b. Aenesidemus

We know practically nothing about Aenesidemus except that he lived sometime in the 1st Century B.C.E., and that he dedicated one of his written works to a Lucius Tubero, a friend of Cicero's who was also a member of the Academy. This has led most scholars to suppose that Aenesidemus was a member of the Academy, probably during the period of Philo's leadership, and that his revival of Pyrrhonian skepticism was probably a reaction to Philo's tendency towards fallibilism. Although this is plausible, it makes the fact that Cicero never mentions him quite puzzling.

i. Revival of Pyrrhonism

Aenesidemus' Pyrrhonian Discourses (Pyrrhoneia), like the rest of his works, have not survived, but they are summarized by a ninth century Byzantine patriarch, Photius, who is remarkable in his own right. In his Bibliothêkê (Bib.), he summarized 280 books, including the Pyrrhoneia, apparently from memory. It is clear from his summary that he thinks very little of Aenesidemus' work. This is due to his view that Aenesidemus' skepticism makes no contribution to Christian dogma and drives from our minds the instinctive tenets of faith (Bib. 170b39-40). Nevertheless, a comparison of his summaries with the original texts that have survived reveal that Photius is a generally reliable source (Wilson [1994]). So despite his assessment of Aenesidemus' skepticism, the consensus is that he provides an accurate summary of thePyrrhoneia. The proper interpretation of that summary, however, is disputed.

Aenesidemus was a member of Plato's Academy, apparently during the period of Philo's leadership. Growing dissatisfied with what he considered the dogmatism of the Academy, he sought to revitalize skepticism by moving back to a purer form inspired by Pyrrho. His specific complaint against his contemporary Academics was that they confidently affirm some things, even Stoic beliefs, and unambiguously deny other things. In other words, the Academics, in Aenesidemus' view, were insufficiently impressed by our epistemic limitations.

His alternative was to "determine nothing," not even the claim that he determines nothing. Instead, the Pyrrhonist says that things are no more one way than another. This form of speech is ambiguous (in a positive sense, from Aenesidemus' perspective) since it neither denies nor asserts anything unconditionally. In other words, the Pyrrhonist will only assert that some property belongs to some object relative to some observer or relative to some set of circumstances. Thus, he will conditionally affirm some things but he will absolutely deny that any property belongs to anything in every possible circumstance. This seems to be what Aenesidemus meant by "determining nothing," for his relativized assertions say nothing definite about the nature of the object in question. Such statements take the form: it is not the case that X is by nature F. This is a simple denial that X is always and invariably F, though of course X may be F in some cases. But such statements are importantly different from those of the form: X is by nature not-F. For these sorts of statements affirm that X is invariably not-F and that there can be no cases of X that exhibit the property F. The only acceptable form of expression for Aenesidemus then seems to be statements that may sometimes be false (See Woddruff [1988] for this interpretation, also Bett 2000).

ii. The Ten Modes

The kinds of conclusion that Aenesidemus countenanced as a Pyrrhonist can more clearly be seen by considering the kinds of arguments he advanced to reach them. He apparently produced a set of skeptical argument forms, or modes, for the purpose of refuting dogmatic claims regarding the natures of things. Sextus Empiricus discusses one such group, the Ten Modes, in some detail (PH 1.35-163, M 7.345, see also Diogenes Laertius' account of the Ten Modes at 9.79-88, and the partial account in Philo of Alexandria, On Drunkenness 169-205, and see Annas and Barnes [1985] for detailed and critical discussion of all ten modes).

The first mode is designed to show that it is not reasonable to suppose that the way the world appears to us humans is more accurate than the incompatible ways it appears to other animals. This will force us to suspend judgment on the question of how these things are by nature, in and of themselves, insofar as we have no rational grounds on which to prefer our appearances and insofar as we are not willing to accept that something can have incompatible properties by nature. If, for example, manure appears repulsive to humans and delightful to dogs, weare unable to say that it really is, in its nature, either repulsive or delightful, or both repulsive and delightful. It is no more delightful than not-delightful, and no more repulsive than not-repulsive, (again, in its nature).

Just as the world appears in incompatible ways to members of different species, so too does it appear incompatibly to members of the same species. Thus, the second mode targets the endless disagreements among dogmatists. But once again, we will find no rational ground to prefer our own view of things, for if an interested party makes himself judge, we should be suspicious of the judgment he reaches, and not accept it.

The third mode continues the line of reasoning developed in the first two. Just as the world appears in incompatible ways to different people, it also appears incompatibly to the different senses of one and the same person. So, for example, painted objects seem to have spatial dimensions that are not revealed to our sense of touch. Similarly, perfume is pleasant to the nose but disgusting to the tongue. Thus, perfume is no more pleasant than not-pleasant.

The fourth mode shows that differences in the emotional or physical state of the perceiver affects his perception of the world. Being in love, calm and warm, one will experience the cold wind that comes in with his beloved quite differently than if he is angry and cold. We are unable to adjudicate between these incompatible experiences of the cold wind because we have no rational grounds on which to prefer our experience in one set of circumstances to our experience in another. One might say that we should give preference to the experiences of those who are healthy, sane and calm as that is our natural state. But in response, we may employ the second mode to challenge the notion of a single, healthy condition that is universally applicable.

The fifth mode shows that differences in location and position of an observed object relative to the observer will greatly affect the way the object appears. Here we find the oar that appears bent in water, the round tower that appears square from a distance, and the pigeon's neck that changes color as the pigeon moves. These features are independent of the observer in a way that the first four modes are not. But similar to the first four, in each case we are left without any rational grounds on which to prefer some particular location or position over another. Why should we suppose, for example, that the pigeon's neck is really green rather than blue? And if we should propose some proof, or theory, in support of it being really blue, we will have to face the skeptic's demand for further justification of that theory, which will set off an infinite regress.

The sixth mode claims that nothing can be experienced in its simple purity but is always experienced as mixed together with other things, either internally in its composition or externally in the medium in which it is perceived. This being the case, we are unable to ever experience the nature of things, and thus are unable to ever say what that nature is.

The seventh mode appeals to the way different effects are produced by altering the quantity and proportions of things. For example, too much wine is debilitating but the right amount is fortifying. Similarly, a pile of sand appears smooth, but individual grains appear rough. Thus, we are led to conclude that wine is no more debilitating than fortifying and sand is no more smooth than rough, in their natures.

The eighth mode, from relativity, is a paradigm for the whole set of modes. It seeks to show, in general, that something appears to have the property F only relative to certain features of the perceiving subject or relative to certain features of the object. And, once again, insofar as we are unable to prefer one set of circumstances to another with respect to the nature of the object, we must suspend judgment about those natures.

The ninth modes points out that the frequency of encountering a thing affects the way that thing appears to us. If we see something that we believe to be rare it will appear more valuable. And when we encounter some beautiful thing for the first time it will seem more beautiful or striking than it appears after we become familiar with it. Thus, we must conclude, for example, that a diamond is no more valuable than worthless.

Finally, the tenth mode, which bears on ethics, appeals to differences in customs and law, and in general, to differences in the ways we evaluate the world. For some, homosexuality is acceptable and good, and to others it is unacceptable and bad. In and of itself, homosexuality is neither good nor bad, but only relative to some way of evaluating the world. And again, since we are unable to prefer one set of values to another, we are led to the conclusion that we must suspend judgment, this time with respect to the intrinsic value of things.

In each of these modes, Aenesidemus seems to be advancing a sort of relativism: we may only say that some object X has property F relative to some observer or set of circumstances, and not absolutely. Thus his skepticism is directed exclusively at a version of Essentialism; in this case, the view that some object has property F in any and every circumstance. A further question is whether Aenesidemus intends his attack on Essentialism to be ontological or epistemological. If it is epistemological, then he is claiming that we simply cannot know what the nature or essence of some thing is, or even whether it has one. This seems most likely to have been Aenesidemus' position since Photius' summary begins with the remark that the overall aim of the Pyrrhoneia is to show that there is no firm basis for cognition. Similarly, the modes seem to be exclusively epistemological insofar as they compel us to suspend judgment; they are clearly designed to force the recognition that no perspective can be rationally preferred to any other with respect to real natures, or essences. By contrast, the ontological view that there are no essences, is not compatible with suspending judgment on the question.

iii. Tranquility

We do not have enough evidence to determine precisely why Aenesidemus found inspiration in Pyrrho. One important point, however, is that they both promote a connection between tranquility and an acceptance of our epistemic limitations (see Bett [2000] for an elaboration of this view). Diogenes Laertius attributes the view to both Anesidemus and the followers of Timon that as a result of suspending judgment, freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) will follow as a shadow (DL 9.107-8). Similarly, Photius reports Aenesidemus' view that those who follow the philosophy of Pyrrho will be happy, whereas by contrast, the dogmatists will wear themselves out in futile and ceaseless theorizing (Bib. 169b12-30, LS 71C). Although there seem to be important differences in what Pyrrho and Aenesidemus understood by our epistemic limitations, they both promoted tranquility as the goal, or at least end product. In general terms the idea is clear enough: the way to a happy, tranquil existence is to live in accordance with how things seem, including especially our evaluative impressions of the world. Rather than trying to uncover some hidden reality, we should accept our limitations, operate in accordance with custom and habit, and not be disturbed by what we cannot know (see Striker [1990/1996]).

c. Sextus Empiricus

We know very little about Sextus Empiricus, aside from the fact that he was a physician. He may have been alive as early as the 2nd Century C.E. or as late as the 3rd Century C.E. We cannot be certain as to where he lived, or where he practiced medicine, or where he taught, if indeed he did teach. In addition to his philosophical books, he also wrote some medical treatises (referred to at M 7.202, 1.61) which are no longer extant.

There are three philosophical works that have survived. Two of these works are grouped together under the general heading, Adversus Mathematikos-which may be translated as Against the Learned, or Against the Professors, i.e. those who profess to know something worth teaching. This grouping is potentially misleading as the first group of six books (chapters, by current standards) are complete and form a self-contained whole. In fact Sextus refers to them with the title Skeptical Treatises. Each of these books target some specific subject in which people profess to be experts, thus: grammar, rhetoric, mathematics, geometry, astrology and music. These are referred to as M 1 through 6, respectively.

There are five additional books in the second set grouped under the heading Adversus Mathematikos:two books containing arguments against the Logicians (M 7, 8), two books against the Physicists (M 9, 10), and one book against the Ethicists (M 11). This set of books is apparently incomplete since the opening of M 7 refers back to a general outline of skepticism that is in none of the extant books of M.

The third work is the Outlines of Pyrrhonism, in three books. The first book provides an outline summary of Pyrrhonian skepticism and would correspond to the missing portion of M. Books 2 and 3 provide arguments against the Logicians, Physicists and Ethicists, corresponding to M 7 through 11. The discussion in PH tends to be much more concise and carefully worded, though there is greater detail and development of many of the same arguments in M. The nature of the relation between these three works is much disputed, especially since the view presented in PH seems to be incompatible with large portions of M (see Bett [1997]).

The following discussion is limited to the views presented in PH.

i. General Account of Skepticism

Sextus begins his overview of Pyrrhonian skepticism by distinguishing three fundamental types of philosopher: dogmatists, who believe they have discovered the truth; Academics (negative dogmatists), who believe the truth cannot be discovered; and skeptics, who continue to investigate, believing neither that anyone has so far discovered the truth nor that it is impossible to do so. Although his characterization of Academics is probably polemical and unfair, the general distinctions he makes are important.

Sextus understands the skeptic, at least nominally as Pyrrho and Aenesidemus do, as one who by suspending judgment determines nothing, and enjoys tranquility as a result. But, as we will see, his conception of suspending judgment is considerably different from his predecessors'.

ii. The Path to Skepticism

According to Sextus, one does not start out as a skeptic, but rather stumbles on to it. Initially, one becomes troubled by the kinds of disagreements focused on in Aenesidemus' modes and seeks to determine which appearances accurately represent the world and which explanations accurately reveal the causal histories of events. The motivation for figuring things out, Sextus asserts, is to become tranquil, i.e. to remove the disturbance that results from confronting incompatible views of the world. As the proto-skeptic attempts to sort out the evidence and discover the privileged perspectiveor the correct theory, he finds that for each account that purports to establish something true about the world there is another, equally convincing account, that purports to establish an opposed and incompatible view of the same thing. Being faced with this equipollence, he is unable to assent to either of the opposed accounts and thereby suspends judgment. This, of course, is not what he set out to do. But by virtue of his intellectual integrity, he is simply not able to arrive at a conclusion and so he finds himself without any definite view. What he also finds is that the tranquility that he originally thought would come only by arriving at the truth, follows upon his suspended judgment as a shadow follows a body.

Sextus provides a vivid story to illustrate this process. A certain painter, Apelles, was trying to represent foam on the mouth of the horse he was painting. But each time he applied the paint he failed to get the desired effect. Growing frustrated, he flung the sponge, on which he had been wiping off the paint, at the picture, inadvertently producing the effect he had been struggling to achieve (PH 1.28-29). The analogous point in the case of seeking the truth is that the desired tranquility only comes indirectly, not by giving up the pursuit of truth, but rather by giving up the expectation that we must acquire truth to get tranquility. It is a strikingly Zen-like point: one cannot intentionally acquire a peaceful, tranquil state but must let it happen as a result of giving up the struggle. But again, giving up the struggle for the skeptic does not mean giving up the pursuit of truth. The skeptic continues to investigate in order to protect himself against the deceptions and seductions of reason that lead to our holding definite views.

Arriving at definite views is not merely a matter of intellectual dishonesty, Sextus thinks; more importantly, it is the main source of all psychological disturbance. For those who believe that things are good or bad by nature, are perpetually troubled. When they lack what they believe to be good their lives must seem seriously deficient if not outright miserable, and they struggle as much as possible to acquire those things. But when they finally have what they believe to be good, they spend untold effort in maintaining and preserving those things and live in fear of losing them (PH 1.27).

Sextus' diagnosis is not limited to evaluative beliefs, however. This is clear by virtue of the fact that he provides extensive arguments against physical and logical (broadly speaking, scientific and epistemological) theories also. How, then, do such beliefs contribute to the psychological disturbances that Sextus seeks to eliminate? The most plausible reply is that any such belief that we find Sextus arguing against in PH is one that will inevitably contribute to one's evaluations of the world and thus will contribute to the intense strivings that characterize disturbance. An examination of a sample of the logical and physical theses that Sextus' discusses bears this out. Many of these beliefs played foundational roles in the Epicurean or Stoic systems, and thus were employed to establish ethical and evaluative beliefs. Believing that the physical world is composed of invisible atoms, for example, would not, by itself, produce any disturbance since we must draw inferences from this belief in order for it to have any significance for us with respect to choice and avoidance. So it is more appropriate to look past the disturbance that may be produced by individual, isolated beliefs, and consider instead the effect of accepting a system of interrelated, mutually supporting dogmatic claims.

iii. The Modes of Agrippa

As a supplement to the Ten Modes of Aenesidemus (as well as his Eight Modes aimed at causal explanations, see PH 1.180-85, and Hankinson [1998]), Sextus offers a set of Five Modes (PH 1.164-77) and Two Modes (PH 1.178-79) employed by "more recent skeptics." We may gather from Diogenes (9.88) that the more recent skeptic referred to is Agrippa. It is important to point out that Sextus merely reports these modes, he does not endorse them at a theoretical level. That is, he does not claim that they possess any sort of logical standing, e.g. that they are guaranteed to reveal a flaw in dogmatic positions, or that they represent some ideal form of reasoning. Instead, we should think of these modes as part of the general account of skepticism, with which the skeptic's practice coheres (PH 1.16-17). In other words, these modes simply describe the way Sextus and his fellow skeptics behave dialectically.

Agrippa's Five Modes relies on the prevalence of dispute and repeats the main theme of Aenesidemus' Modes: we are frequently faced with dissenting opinions regarding the same matter and yet we have no adequate grounds on which to prefer one view over another. Should a dogmatist offer an account of such grounds, the skeptic may then request further justification, thereby setting off an infinite regress. And presumably, we should not be willing to accept an explanation that is never complete, i.e. one that requires further explaining itself. Should the dogmatist try to put a stop to the regress by means of a hypothesis, the skeptic will refuse to accept the claim without proof, perhaps citing alternative, incompatible hypotheses. And finally, the skeptic will refuse to allow the dogmatist to support his explanation by what he is supposed to be explaining, disallowing any circular reasoning. And of course the skeptic may also avail himself of the observation that what is being explained only appears as it does relative to some relevant conditions, and thus, contrary to the dogmatist's presumption, there is no one thing to be explained in the first place (see Barnes [1990]).

iv. Skepticism vs. Relativism

Sextus employs these skeptical modes towards quite a different goal from Aenesidemus'. Aenesidemus, as we have seen, countenances relativistic assertions of the form, X is no more F than not F. This is to say that although X is not really, in its nature, F, it is still genuinely F in some particular circumstance. And it is acceptable for the Aenesidemean skeptic to believe that this is the case. But for Sextus, the skeptical refrain, "I determine nothing" excludes relativistic beliefs as well. It is not acceptable for Sextus to believe that X is F, even with relativistic disclaimers. Instead, Sextus would have us refrain from believing even that X is no more F than not-F. Thus, suspension of judgment extends farther for Sextus than it does for Aenesidemus.

v. The Skeptical Life

So, skepticism is an ability to discover opposed arguments of equal persuasive force, the practice of which leads first to suspension of judgment and afterwards, fortuitously, to tranquility. This makes Sextus' version of Pyrrhonian skepticism dramatically different from other Western philosophical positions, for it is a practice or activity rather than a set of doctrines. Indeed, insofar as the skeptic is supposed to live without belief (adoxastôs), he could not consistently endorse any philosophical doctrine. But how is it possible to live without beliefs?

The short answer is that one may simply follow appearances and withhold judgment as to whether the world really is as it appears. This seems plausible with respect to physical perceptions, but appearances for Sextus include evaluations, and this creates a complication. For how can the skeptic say "this appears good (or bad) to me, but I don't believe that it is really good or bad"? It seems that there is no difference between evaluative appearances and evaluative beliefs.

One possible response to this problem is to say that Sextus only targets sophisticated, philosophical theories about value, or about physics or logic, but allows everyday attitudes and beliefs to stand. On this view, skepticism is a therapy designed to cure the disease of academics and theoreticians. But it seems that Sextus intends his philosophical therapy to be quite widely applicable. The skeptical life, as he presents it, is an achievement and not merely the recovering of a native innocence lost to philosophical speculation. (See Burnyeat and Frede [1997], Brennan [1999] for the debate regarding what the skeptic is supposed to suspend judgment about.)

Any answer to the question about how the skeptic may live without beliefs will depend on what sort of beliefs we think the skeptic avoids. Nevertheless, an elaboration on living in accordance with appearances comes in the form of the fourfold observances. Rather than investigate the best way to live or even what to do in some particular circumstance, Sextus remarks that the skeptic will guide his actions by (1) nature, (2) necessitation by feelings, (3) laws and customs, and (4) kinds of expertise (PH 1.23-24). Nature provides us with the capacity for perception and thought, and we may use these capacities insofar as they don't lead us to dogmatic belief. Similarly, hunger and thirst will drive us towards food and drink without our having to form any explicit beliefs regarding those physical sensations. One need not accept any nutritional theories to adequately and appropriately respond to hunger and thirst. Laws and customs will inform us of the appropriate evaluations of things. We need not actually believe that the gods exist and that they are benevolent to take part in religious ceremonies or even to act in a manner that is (or at least appears) pious. But note that the skeptic will neither believe that the gods exist nor that they do not exist-he is neither a theist nor an atheist, but agnostic in a very robust sense. And finally, the skeptic may practice some trade or profession without accepting any theories regarding his practice. For example, a carpenter need not have any theoretical or geometrical views about doors in order to be skillful at hanging them. Similarly, a doctor need not accept any physiological theories to successfully heal his patients. The further question, recalling the dispute explored in Burnyeat and Frede [1997], is whether the skeptic merely avoids sophisticated, theoretical beliefs in employing these observances, or whether he avoids all beliefs whatsoever.

4. Skepticism and the Examined Life

A unifying feature of the varieties of ancient skepticism is that they are all concerned with promoting, in some manner of speaking, the benefits of recognizing our epistemic limitations. Thus, ancient skeptics nearly always have something to say about how one may live, and indeed live well, in the absence of knowledge.

The fallibilism that developed in Plato's Academy should be seen in this light. Rather than forego the potential benefits of an examination aimed at acquiring better beliefs, the later Academics opted for a less ambitious criterion, one that would give them merely reliable beliefs. Nonetheless, they maintained a thoroughly skeptical attitude towards the possibility of attaining certainty, but without claiming to have conclusively ruled it out.

The more radical skepticism that we find in Sextus' Outlines of Pyrrhonism suggests a move in a different direction. Rather than explain how or why we should trust the skeptical employment of reason, Sextus avoids the problem altogether by, in effect, refusing to answer. Instead, he would suggest that we consider the reasons in support of some particular answer and the reasons opposed in accordance with the skeptical ability so that we may regain tranquility.

5. Greek and Latin Texts, Commentaries, and Translations


  • Long and Sedley, eds. (1987), The Hellenistic Philosophers, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), is a good place to start. These volumes contain selections from the primary sources grouped by topic. See volume 1, sections 68-72 and the following commentaries (pp. 438-488) for readings on Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism, and sections 1-3 with commentaries (pp. 13-24) for readings on Pyrrho. Volume 2 contains the original Greek and Latin texts corresponding to the translations in volume 1.
  • Inwood and Gerson, eds. (1988), Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings, Indianapolis: Hackett), also contains translated selections from the primary sources for Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism.
  • Annas and Barnes, eds. (1985), The Modes Of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), is a very useful arrangement and translation of the texts that discuss the different varieties of Pyrrhonian argumentation.

For the Greek edition of Photius' summary of Aenesidemus, see R. Henry, ed. (1962), Photius: Bibliothêque, Tome III, (Paris). For a very readable translation, informative introduction and notes, see N.G. Wilson (1994), Photius: The Bibliotheca, (London: Duckworth).

There have been some recently updated and much improved translations and commentaries on Sextus Empiricus.

  • Annas, J. and J. Barnes (1994), Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bett, R. (1997), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Ethicists (Adversus Mathematikos XI),(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Blank, D. (1998), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Grammarians (Adversus Mathematikos I),(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Greaves, D.D. (1986), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Musicians (Adversus Mathematikos VI), (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press).
  • Mates, B. (1996), The Skeptic Way: Sextus Empiricus's Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Translated with Introduction and Commentary, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Many of the primary texts can be found in the Loeb series, which contains facing pages of text in the original language and translation. Among the most important are (all published by Harvard University Press):

  • Bury, R.G. (1933), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Pyrrhonism.
  • Bury, R.G. (1935), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Logicians
  • Bury, R.G. (1936), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Physicists, Against the Ethicists.
  • Bury, R.G. (1949), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Professors. Hicks, R.D. (1925), trans.,Diogenes Laertius: Lives of Eminent Philosophers, vols. 1 and 2.
  • Rackham, H. (1933), trans., Cicero: De Natura Deorum, Academica.
  • Rackham, H. (1914), trans., Cicero: De Finibus Bonorum et Malorum.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Annas, J., (1996), "Scepticism, Old and New," in M. Frede and G. Striker, eds., Rationality in Greek Thought, (Oxford: Clarendon).
  • Annas, J. (1993), The Morality of Happiness, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Annas, J. (1992), "Plato the Sceptic," in J. Klagge and N. Smith, eds., Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, Supp. Vol., 43-72.
  • Annas, J. (1990), "Stoic Epistemology," in S. Everson, ed., Epistemology, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
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Author Information

Harald Thorsrud
New Mexico State University
U. S. A.

Contemporary Skepticism

Philosophical views are typically classed as skeptical when they involve advancing some degree of doubt regarding claims that are elsewhere taken for granted. Varieties of skepticism can be distinguished in two main ways, depending upon the focus and the extent of the doubt.

As regards the former, skeptical views typically have an epistemological form, in that they are focused on the epistemic status of certain beliefs. For example, one common variety of skepticism concerns our beliefs about the past and argues that such beliefs lack positive epistemic status - that they are not justified, or are not rational, or cannot constitute knowledge (and perhaps even all three). Where skepticism does not have this epistemological focus, then it tends to be of an ontological form in that it is directed at beliefs about the existence of some supposedly problematic entity, such as the self or God. Here the target of the skepticism is not so much one's putative knowledge of these entities (though it may be that as well), but rather the claim that they exist at all.

As regards the latter, one can differentiate between skeptical views that are either local or radical. Local varieties of skepticism will only concern beliefs about a certain specific subject matter, such as beliefs in abstract objects or the conclusions of inductive arguments. Since ontological varieties of skepticism tend to be concerned with the existence of particular sorts of entities, they are usually (though not always) of this local form. In contrast, radical forms of skepticism afflict most of our beliefs and thus pose, at least potentially, the most pressing philosophical challenge.

Perhaps unsurprisingly, the locus for discussion of skepticism has tended to be radical epistemological varieties of skepticism, and this is certainly a trend that has continued into contemporary debate. In historical discussion, for example, the two most influential forms of skepticism have, arguably, been the radical epistemological skepticism of the classical Pyrrhonian skeptics and the Cartesian form of radical epistemological skepticism that Descartes considers in his Meditations. The former consists of a variety of skeptical techniques that counter any grounds that are offered for belief with grounds for doubt (or at least non-belief) that are at least as persuasive. Since no belief is more reasonable than its denial, the Pyrrhonian skeptics concluded that one ought to be skeptical about most (if not all) of one's beliefs. Cartesian skepticism reaches a similar conclusion, though this time by highlighting through the use of skeptical hypotheses that we cannot be certain of any (or at least hardly any) of our beliefs and thus must retreat to skepticism. Roughly, a skeptical hypothesis is an error-possibility that is incompatible with the knowledge that we ascribe to ourselves but which is also subjectively indistinguishable from normal circumstances (or, at least, what we take normal circumstances to be), such as that we might be currently experiencing a very vivid dream. Since such scenarios are subjectively indistinguishable from normal circumstances, the Cartesian skeptical move is to say that we cannot know that they are false and that this threatens the certainty of our beliefs.

What is common to both of these historical approaches, and which lives on in the contemporary discussion of skepticism, is the primary conception of skepticism as resting on an entirely intuitive and pre-theoretical understanding of our epistemic concepts. In this sense it has the form of a paradox - a series of wholly plausible and intuitive claims that, collectively, lead to an intellectually devastating conclusion. Recent discussion of skepticism also treats the problem as having this paradoxical form, though the epistemic focus of the discussion is now not so much the lack of grounds for belief which counter the skeptic's grounds against belief, or the lack of certainty, but rather the lack of knowledge. Contemporary discussions of skepticism have thus tended to make the radical epistemological claim that we fail to know (hardly) anything.

Table of Contents

  1. The Skeptical Paradox in Contemporary Debate
  2. Relevant Alternatives, Infallibilism, and Closure
  3. Semantic Contextualism
  4. "Hinge" Propositions and Inferential Contextualism
  5. Neo-Moorean Responses to Skepticism
  6. Epistemological Externalism and the New Skeptics
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Skeptical Paradox in Contemporary Debate

Contemporary discussion of the problem of the radical skepticism has tended to focus on a formulation of that problem in terms of a paradox consisting of the joint incompatibility of three claims, each of which appears, on the surface of things and taken individually, to be perfectly in order. Roughly, they are as follows.

First, that we are unable to know that any one of a number of skeptical hypotheses are false, where a skeptical hypothesis is understood as a scenario that is subjectively indistinguishable from what one takes normal circumstances to be but which, if true, would undermine most of the knowledge that one ascribes to oneself. A standard example of a skeptical hypothesis is the so-called ‘brain-in-a-vat' (BIV) hypothesis that one is being ‘fed’ one’s experiences by computers. If this were true, then most of what one believes about the world would be false (or, at the very least, true in a different way from how one would expect), and thus one would lack knowledge. Moreover, this scenario is characterised such that there would be no perceptible difference between being a BIV and having the non-BIV experiences one currently takes oneself to be experiencing and thus, plausibly, it does not seem to be a scenario that we could ever know to be false. We thus get our first ‘intuitive’ element of the skeptical paradox:

I. I am unable to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses.

The second ‘intuitive' claim about knowledge that the skeptic employs is the following:

II. If I do not know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, then I do not know very much.

What motivates this claim is the compelling thought that unless one can rule-out the kind of error-possibilities at issue in skeptical hypotheses by knowing them to be false, then this suffices to undermine most (if not all) of the knowledge that one traditionally ascribes to oneself. After all, if I were a BIV, then I wouldn't be sitting here now. Hence, if, for all I know, I could be a BIV, surely it must follow that I do not know that I am sitting here now (and much more besides)?

Finally, there is the third element of the skeptical paradox that creates the required overall philosophical tension. This is the highly plausible claim that we do know a great deal of what we think we know:

III. A lot of what I believe, I know.

Of course, there may be lots of abstract and technical kinds of knowledge which I think I have but actually lack, but the point of this intuition is that many of the ‘ordinary' propositions that I believe (such as that I am sitting here now) do seem to be the kinds of propositions that I could not plausibly be wrong about in a wholesale fashion. With these three claims in place, however, the puzzle becomes obvious. For if I cannot know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, and if this lack of knowledge entails that I lack knowledge of most of what I believe, it follows that I must lack knowledge of most of what I believe. Hence, one cannot accept all of these three claims; one of them must go.

The skeptic offers a very simple way out of this puzzle, which is to deny, on the basis of I and II, that we ever have knowledge of the kind of ordinary propositions at issue in III. That is, the skeptic argues as follows:

(S1) I am unable to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses.

(S2) If I do not know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, then I do not know very much.


(SC) I do not know very much.

For example, a skeptical argument which employed the BIV skeptical hypothesis might well run as follows:

(S1*) I am unable to know that I am not a BIV.

(S2*) If I do not know that I am not a BIV, then I do not know very much.


(SC*) I do not know very much,

Clearly, however, this radical skeptical suggestion regarding how we should respond to these three incompatible claims is less of a proposal than a reductio of epistemological theorising. This conclusion is, after all, intellectually devastating, consigning our cognitive activities to, at best, a kind of bad faith. We would thus be wise to look closely at the anti-skeptical alternatives before we accept this (paradoxical) response to the skeptical paradox.

If we are to evade skepticism, we are thus going to have to motivate one (or more) of the following three claims. First, that, despite appearances, we do (or at least can) know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses after all. Second, that, despite appearances, it does not follow from the fact that we lack knowledge of the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses that we thereby lack knowledge of ordinary propositions as well. Third, that, despite appearances, these three claims are consistent after all.

2. Relevant Alternatives, Infallibilism, and Closure

Of the three anti-skeptical strategies just listed, the second looks, prima facie, to be the most promising. After all, this does seem to be the weakest element of the skeptical argument since, although it is at first pass intuitive, on reflection it is far from immediately obvious that our knowledge of everyday propositions should be dependent upon anti-skeptical knowledge in this fashion. One response to the problem of skepticism has thus been to deny this premise in the skeptical argument by arguing that one can perfectly well know everyday propositions whilst failing to know the denials of anti-skeptical hypotheses such as the BIV hypothesis.

One motivation for this line of argument has been to argue that skeptical error-possibilities are just not relevant to everyday knowledge in the way that everyday error-possibilities are. After all, we do not ordinarily demand that agents should rule out skeptical error-possibilities before we ascribe them knowledge. This relevant alternatives (RA) line of argument, which has its roots in work by J. L. Austin (1961), has been developed by Fred Dretske (1970). As Dretske is aware, however, simply denying (S2) of the skeptical argument on these grounds is not enough, rather one needs to also engage with the epistemological theses that underlie this premise and offer a fully-fledged account of what this notion of epistemological relevance involves.

One epistemological thesis that is often thought to provide support for (S2) is that of infallibilism. This is the thesis that, roughly, for an agent to know a proposition that agent must be able to eliminate all error-possibilities associated with that proposition. Provided that one is willing to make the plausible move of construing ‘eliminate' here in terms of the ability to know the negation of then one straightforwardly gets the requisite link between infallibilism and (S2) since the skeptical hypothesis in question (whichever skeptical hypothesis it is) will clearly be an error possibility which must be known to be false if the agent is to have knowledge of the ordinary proposition at issue. Accordingly, an inability to know the denial of the skeptical hypothesis will suffice to ensure that the agent lacks knowledge of the ordinary proposition, just as (S2) says. In effect, infallibilism is the opposing thesis to the RA line because it counts every alternative as being relevant.

Although infallibilism may seem to be an obviously false epistemological thesis, a persuasive case can be made in its defence. In particular, Peter Unger (1971; 1975) has been a prominent defender of a version of infallibilism (although in more recent work, such as Unger (1984; 1986) he has moved towards a thesis which is more in line with contextualism, a view which we will be considering below). In these early works Unger argued that ‘knowledge' is an "absolute term" like ‘flat’ or ‘empty’. According to Unger, what is interesting about absolute terms is that they are never really satisfied, although we often talk as if they are. So, for example, nothing is ever really flat or really empty because, respectively, no surface is ever completely free of friction and no container could ever be a vacuum. Accordingly, even though we may loosely talk of Holland’s ‘flat’ roads or John’s ‘empty’ fridge, reflection indicates to us that such assertions are, in fact, false (Holland’s roads have some bumps on them, however small, and John’s fridge, whilst empty of food, is ‘full’ of air, not to mention refrigerator parts). Similarly, Unger’s point is that what the skeptic is responding to in her arguments is the fact that, strictly speaking, nothing is every really known because to be really known the agent would have to rule out every possibility of error and this is an impossible hurdle to clear (at least for a non-omniscient being). So although we might talk of knowing lots of things, reflection indicates to us, as it does with our use of ‘flat’ and ‘empty’, that our claims to know are all, in fact, false.

We will return to consider infallibilism again below. In the meantime, however, we can set this thesis to one side because there is a (logically) weaker thesis that would also suffice to support (S2). Accordingly, so long as we are able to deny the weaker thesis then we can get a rejection of infallibilism by default. This weaker thesis is the principle that knowledge is ‘closed' under known entailment, or the ‘closure’ principle for short. Roughly, this principle states that if an agent knows a proposition (such as that she is currently seated), and knows that this proposition entails a second proposition (such as that she is not a BIV), then she also knows the second proposition. In general, this can be roughly expressed as follows:

Closure Principle for Knowledge

If an agent knows P, and knows that P entails Q, then that agent knows Q.

Whereas infallibilism supports (S2) by demanding that an agent should be able to know the denials of all error-possibilities, closure merely demands that the agent knows the denials of those error-possibilities that are known to be logical consequences of what one knows. For example, if one knows the ordinary proposition that one is currently seated, and one further knows that if one is seated then one is not a BIV, then one must also know that one is not a BIV. Conversely, if one does not know that one is not a BIV then, given that one knows the entailment in question (which ought to be uncontroversial), one thereby lacks knowledge of the ordinary proposition in question, just as (S2) says. And note that, unlike (S2), the plausibility of closure is not merely prima facie. After all, we reason in conformity with closure all the time in cases where we gain knowledge of previously unknown propositions via knowledge of other propositions and the relevant entailment. Indeed, closure is in this respect far more compelling than infallibilism, since what credibility the latter thesis has is gained by philosophical argument rather than by prima facie reflection on our actual epistemic practice. The theoretical burden imposed upon anyone who advocates the denial of (S2) is thus very strong, since it requires a principled rejection of the intuitive principle of closure.

The standard proposal put forward to support the denial of closure has been some variation of the original RA model advanced by Dretske (1970; 1971; 1981). Essentially, the idea is to claim that knowledge only transfers across known entailments where the entailments in question are ‘relevant'. Thus, knowledge that one is sitting down may transfer across a known entailment to the relevant proposition that one is not standing up, but it won’t transfer across a known entailment to the irrelevant proposition that one is not a BIV. Accordingly, the link between ordinary knowledge and anti-skeptical knowledge required by the skeptic is severed and ordinary knowledge is secured. Dretske himself puts the point as follows:

The general point may be put this way: there are certain presuppositions associated with a statement. These presuppositions, although their truth is entailed by the truth of the statement, are not part of what is operated on when we operate on the statement with one of our epistemic operators. The epistemic operators do not penetrate to these presuppositions. (Dretske 1970, 1014)

In effect, what Dretske is arguing here is that in everyday contexts an agent's acquisition of knowledge of the propositions at issue in that context presupposes the falsity of certain irrelevant error-possibilities. That they are taken for granted is, for Dretske, entirely legitimate (that is, he rejects infallibilism). Nevertheless, the negations of these error-possibilities are often entailed by what is known in that context and thus, if closure held, it would follow that an agent could come to have knowledge of what is presupposed in her knowledge simply by knowing the relevant entailment. It is this that Dretske objects to, arguing that one’s epistemic position regarding the antecedent proposition will not transfer to the consequent proposition where the consequent proposition has performed this ‘presuppositional’ role.

An example will help clarify matters. Consider the following two propositions (adapted from ones adduced by Dretske (1970)):

(P) The animals in the pen are zebras.

(Q) The animals in the pen are not mules cleverly disguised to look like zebras.

Dretske argues that in normal circumstances one can come to know (P) without making any special checks to ensure that the irrelevant error-possibility at issue in (Q) is false. Instead, all the agent needs to do is have evidence that eliminates relevant error-possibilities (such as, for example, evidence to support her belief that it is the zebra enclosure and not the ape enclosure that she is looking at). This is fortunate, because if we demand that the agent must rule-out the kind of error-possibility at issue in (Q) (and thus, one might reasonably assume, know (Q)) before she can know (P), then we will end up setting the requirement for knowledge at a very high level. Indeed, it will be highly unlikely that your average agent would be able to know a proposition like (P) if this demand is made, because the average agent would not be able to tell a zebra apart from a cleverly disguised mule. Nevertheless, Dretske acknowledges that the agent's knowledge of (P) presupposes that the error-possibility at issue in (Q) is false. Here is the crux, however. If we allow closure to stand, then it will follow from the agent’s knowledge of (P), and her knowledge of the entailment from (P) to (Q), that she thereby knows (Q) also, even though we have already granted that the agent in question is not in a position to be able to know such a thing. Dretske puts the point as follows:

If you are tempted to say [that the agent does know (Q) ...], think for a moment about the reasons that you have, what evidence you can produce in favour of this claim. The evidence you had for thinking them zebras has been effectively neutralised, since it does not count toward their not being mules cleverly disguised. Have you checked with the zoo authorities? Did you examine the animals closely enough to detect such a fraud? (Dretske 1970, 1016)

Dretske thus concludes that we should instead allow that an agent might be able to know (P) whilst failing to know (Q), and thus, given that the entailment is known, that closure fails.

This is certainly a very compelling argument, and it does at the very least offer a prima facie case against closure. The job is not quite done, however, because we also need to be given an account of knowledge which will flesh-out this account of relevance. After all, we have strong intuitions that our epistemic concepts do license closure. It is to this end that Dretske (1971) went on to develop his ‘modal' account of knowledge, an account which was adapted and supplemented by Robert Nozick (1981).

What Dretske needs is a theory of knowledge which, whilst being plausible, can also explain how we can know everyday propositions whilst failing to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, even in cases where we know that the everyday proposition in question entails the relevant denial of the skeptical hypothesis. Given these arduous demands, his proposal is, to say the least, ingenious. In essence, what Dretske does is to adduce a modal condition on knowledge, what I will call ‘Dretskean Sensitivity', that can be roughly expressed as follows:

Dretskean Sensitivity

If P were not true, then the agent would not believe P.

The basic idea behind Dretskean Sensitivity is that for a belief to count as knowledge it must at least ‘track' the truth in the sense that, not only is it true but, had what is believed been false, the agent would not have believed it. With this condition in play, Dretske can get the result he wants.

Suppose the actual world is pretty much as I take it to be. It follows that my belief that I am currently in my office and my belief that I am not a BIV are both true. Now consider whether the former belief counts as an instance of knowledge. On this account it does (at least pending any further conditions that one wants to add to Dretskean Sensitivity), because in the nearest possible world in which I am not in my office - the world in which, for example, I am in the corridor outside my office - I no longer believe that I am. My belief thus ‘tracks' the truth adequately to be a candidate for knowledge. In contrast, consider my belief that I am not a BIV. The problem with this belief is that in the nearest possible world in which this belief is false (that is, the BIV-world), I continue to have a belief that I am not a BIV because in this world I am the victim of a widespread deception. Accordingly, this belief fails to meet necessary condition for knowledge set out in Dretskean Sensitivity and thus is not even in the running to be an instance of knowledge.

Dretske can thus use Dretskean Sensitivity to explain why closure fails by showing how knowledge needs to be understood relative to a certain relevant range of possible worlds which is variable depending upon the proposition at issue. As a result, one can know one proposition relative to one set of possible worlds, know the entailment to a second proposition, and yet fail to know the second proposition relative to a different set of possible worlds. More specifically, one can have knowledge of everyday propositions relative to one set of possible worlds that is ‘near-to' the actual world, know that it entails the denial of a skeptical hypothesis, and yet lack knowledge of the denial of the skeptical hypothesis because knowledge is here relative to the ‘far-off’ possible worlds that are quite unlike the actual world. The notion of ‘relevance’ at issue in the basic RA account is thus cashed-out in explicitly modal terms. Moreover, since a number of logical principles fail in modal contexts because of this sort of variability, it should not come as much of a surprise to find that closure meets a similar fate. Dretske is thus in a position to offer a plausible account of knowledge that can accommodate all of the claims that we saw him wanting to make earlier.

This conception of knowledge, along with the later more elaborate version advanced by Nozick (1981), has been extremely influential. It is worth noting, however, that it is an epistemologically revisionist anti-skeptical proposal because it results in the denial of the highly plausible principle of closure. With this in mind, there is a prima facie tension involved in adopting such a proposal, despite the compelling defence of this position that Dretske, Nozick and others have offered. After all, the idea that we must know the known consequences of what we know is extremely strong and the rejection of this claim cannot be taken lightly. As Keith DeRose (1995, §5), has pointed out, dropping closure means allowing what he calls "abominable conjunctions", such as that one knows that one has two hands but one does not know that one is not a BIV. That closure should hold has been one of the main motivations for alternative interpretations of the core RA anti-skeptical thesis that do not result in the rejection of closure, as we will see in a moment.

Besides this line of criticism against the Dretske-Nozick account, a number of other claims have been made. I will focus here on those avenues of critique that are directed at the view presented as an anti-skeptical proposal, rather than as an analysis (albeit perhaps only a partial one) of knowledge. Edward Craig (1989; 1990), for instance, has argued that the Dretske-Nozick proposal is either impotent at meeting skeptical arguments or unnecessary. After all, the strategy only works on the assumption that skeptical possible worlds are indeed far-off worlds, and Craig argues that if we are entitled to that supposition then we have no need of an anti-skeptical strategy. Conversely, if we are not entitled to that supposition, then the modal analysis of knowledge offered by Dretske and Nozick leaves us in an impasse with the skeptic which is no better than we were in before. That is, all that the Dretskean approach will have achieved is to show us that, provided the world is in fact pretty much as we take it to be, then skepticism is false and this still leaves the issue of whether the world is in fact pretty much as we take it to be unresolved.

Craig's objection is surely wrong, however, because the skeptical argument purported to show that knowledge was impossible, and the Dretske-Nozick account at least refutes this claim by showing that knowledge is possible; that we can have knowledge provided that certain conditions obtain. What is true, however, is that there is nothing in the Dretske-Nozick line which demands that the agent should be able to become reflectively aware that we have met these conditions if we are to have knowledge, and this ‘externalist’ element of the view may well be problematic. For if this is the case then the existential force of skepticism - that we could indeed, for all we can tell, be a victim of a skeptical hypothesis - is just as powerful as ever. The worry here is that there is always going to be something intellectually unsatisfactory about an anti-skeptical proposal that is run along epistemologically externalist lines. We will consider the role of epistemological externalism and internalism in the skeptical debate in more detail below, since it raises issues which impact upon all anti-skeptical proposals, regardless of whether they retain closure.

The large body of critical appraisal of the Dretskean proposal falls, however, on the rejection of the closure principle, closure. There are two ways in which this critique is often run. Either critics argue directly for the retention of closure and thereby against the Dretskean line by default, or else they try to offer an alternative construal of the motivation for the Dretskean line that retains closure. Peter Klein (1981; 1995) is a good representative of the former position, arguing that, contra Dretske, we can indeed come to know (/be justified in believing) that the animal in the pen is not a cleverly disguised mule on the basis of our knowledge (/justified true belief) that it is a zebra and our knowledge of the entailment. Central to Klein's view is a commitment to epistemological internalism, whose role in the skeptical debate will be discussed below, and a certain view about the structure of reasons that we do not have the space to go into here. The most interesting attacks on the Dretskean approach to closure do not come from this quarter, however, but from those who claim to be motivated by similar epistemological concerns as those which motivate Dretske himself. After all, that one who endorses a radically different conception of the epistemological landscape should not find the Dretskean proposal plausible is not nearly so intriguing as dissent from those who sign-up to many of the key Dretskean claims. In particular, it is interesting to note that two of the main rival views to the Dretskean line are wrought out of the same basic RA claims.

Consider again the core RA thought. This is was that certain error-possibilities are irrelevant to the determination of knowledge, and thus that one can have knowledge merely by eliminating the salient error-possibilities. With this characterisation of the core RA thesis in mind, the natural question to ask is why the core RA thought should be spelt-out along Dretskean lines. After all, the Dretskean line does take far-off skeptical possible worlds to be relevant to the determination of knowledge (albeit only knowledge of anti-skeptical propositions), whereas the basic RA idea was surely that such far-off worlds were manifestly irrelevant to the determination of knowledge (any knowledge). There thus seems to be an ambiguity in the RA thesis. Either we take it as meaning that relevance is determined by the nearest not-P world (no matter how far-out that might be), and thus end up with the thesis that Dretske and Nozick propose, or else we construe it as simply demanding that only near-by possible worlds are relevant worlds. This is no mere technical dispute either, since a great deal hangs upon which alternative we adopt.

After all, if we adopt the latter reading of the core RA thesis then we are left with the thought that knowledge possession only requires tracking the truth in near-by possible worlds and on this construal the motivation for denying closure fades. For not only will an agent's belief in an everyday proposition typically track the truth in near-by possible worlds, so will her belief that she is not a BIV (since she is, by hypothesis, not a BIV in any near-by world). Admittedly, this belief will not track the truth in the nearest possible world in which she is a BIV, but since this possible world is far-off, this fact alone should not suffice on this construal of the RA thesis to undermine her knowledge. An entirely different reading of the core RA thesis thus seems to license the denial of the first premise of the skeptical argument, (S1) - that we are unable to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses - rather than the denial of closure and thus the rejection of the second premise, (S2). Moreover, that this reading of the RA thesis does not result in the failure of closure means that it does possess some considerable dialectical advantage over the Dretske-Nozick thesis.

We will consider how such an approach to skepticism might function in more detail below. First, however, we will look at a different reading of the core RA thesis that also does not result in the denial of closure. Where this line differs from the one just canvassed is that it does not straightforwardly allow that one can know the denials of skeptical hypotheses either. Instead, it argues that the standards for relevance are variable such that, although one knows everyday propositions and thus the denials of skeptical hypotheses relative to a low standard of relevance, one lacks knowledge of these everyday propositions and thus of the denials of skeptical hypotheses at high standards of relevance. In this way, the hope is that this thesis can explain both our skeptical and anti-skeptical intuitions (and our attachment to closure), whilst nevertheless denying the universal correctness of the skeptical argument. This anti-skeptical thesis is contextualism, and since the version that we will be considering regards the mechanisms that alter these standards of relevance to be conversational mechanisms, we will call it semantic contextualism.

3. Semantic Contextualism

Semantic contextualism - as put forward by such figures as Stewart Cohen (1987; 1988; 1991; 1999; 2000), DeRose (1995) and David Lewis (1996) - is without doubt the most dominant form of anti-skeptical theory in the current literature. In essence, this view maintains that skeptical arguments only seem to work because they exploit the way in which the correct employment of our epistemic concepts (such as knowledge) can be influenced by features of the conversational context. More specifically, semantic contextualists argue that the standards for knowledge possession fluctuate depending on what is at issue in that conversational context. Accordingly, they are in a position to allow that both skepticism and anti-skepticism could, in a restricted sense, be true. In skeptical conversational contexts where the standards are high, the skeptical conclusion that we know very little will be true. In contrast, in non-skeptical conversational contexts where the standards will be relatively low, we are in a position to know much of what we think we know, albeit only to this low epistemic standard.

In what follows, I will primarily focus my explication of the semantic contextualist thesis by looking at DeRose's version since this is the most developed (and, arguably, the most influential) characterisation of the thesis which incorporates most of the main features of the other two accounts. Later on, however, I’ll mention some of the key differences between these three versions of the semantic contextualist view. Moreover, in §4, I will be looking at a different type of contextualist theory that is advanced by Michael Williams (1991) - what I call inferential contextualism - which does not conform to the basic semantic contextualist template.

Before we look at the DeRose version of the semantic contextualist thesis, however, it is worthwhile first being clear about the following supposed features of the ‘phenomenology' of our engagement with skepticism since semantic contextualism can most naturally be viewed as a response, and to some extent as an accommodation, of these features:

I. Ascriptions of knowledge to subjects in conversational contexts in which skeptical error-

possibilities have been raised seems improper.

II. In conversational contexts in which no skeptical error-possibilities are in play it seems perfectly appropriate to ascribe knowledge to subjects.

III. All that may change when one moves from a non-skeptical conversational context to a skeptical context are mere conversational factors.

The first two features represent what Williams (1991, chapter one) refers to as our ‘biperspectivalism', our intuition that skepticism is compelling under the conditions of philosophical reflection but never able to impact on everyday life where it is all but ignored. The third feature creates the tension because it highlights our sense that one of these judgements must be wrong. That is, since conversational topic has no obvious bearing on the epistemic status of a subject’s beliefs, that it ought to be universally true (that is, whatever the conversational context) that the subject either does or does not know the propositions in question. So either our knowledge ascriptions in everyday contexts are right (and thus the skeptic is wrong), in which case we shouldn’t take skepticism so seriously in conversational contexts in which skepticism is at issue; or else the skeptic is right, and thus our everyday practice of ascribing knowledge is under threat. Semantic contextualism opposes this thought with the suggestion that what is actually occurring is not a contradiction but a responsiveness, on the part of the attributor of knowledge, to a fluctuation in the epistemic standards (and with them the subject’s possession of knowledge) caused by a change in the conversational context. In effect, and contra the third claim listed above, semantic contextualism holds that mere changes in the conversational context can have an effect on the epistemic status of one’s beliefs so that it can be true both that one has knowledge in everyday contexts whilst lacking it in skeptical conversational contexts.

Accordingly, we find DeRose (1995) arguing that the basic contextualist strategy pivots upon the acceptability, and appropriate use, of the following contextualist thesis:

Suppose a speaker A (for "attributor") says, "S knows that P", of a subject S's true belief that P. According to contextualist theories of knowledge attributions, how strong an epistemic position S must be in with respect to P for A’s assertion to be true can vary according to features of A’s conversational context. (DeRose 1995, 4)

Here we get the essentials of the semantic contextualist view. In particular, we get (i) the claim that the strength of epistemic position that an agent needs to be in if she is to have knowledge can fluctuate from context to context (which makes the thesis contextualist); and (ii) the claim that what is at issue in the determination of contexts in this respect is the conversational context (which makes the contextualist thesis semantic). The interesting question now is how the details of how this account is to function are to be spelt-out.

The first thing that DeRose tries to capture is the intuition that as one moves from one conversational context to another one's epistemic situation (one’s total informational state for instance) could remain exactly the same. DeRose accommodates this intuition in conjunction with the contextualist picture by arguing, as the above quotation indicates, that although one’s "epistemic position" is constant at any one time, the epistemic position that one needs to be in so as to count as possessing knowledge can be variable. Strength of "epistemic position" is characterised by DeRose as follows:

[...] being in a strong epistemic position with respect to P is to have a belief as to whether P is true match the fact of the matter as to whether P is true, not only in the actual world, but also at the worlds sufficiently close to the actual world. That is, one's belief should not only be true, but also should be non-accidentally true, where this requires one’s belief as to whether P is true to match the fact of the matter at nearby worlds. The further away one gets from the actual world, while still having it be the case that one’s belief matches the fact at worlds that far away and closer, the stronger a position one is in with respect to P. (DeRose 1995, 34)

In order to see this, imagine that Lars believes that his car is outside on the basis of a certain fixed informational state (which involves, perhaps, his memory of the car being there a few hours ago, his grounds for believing that no-one would steal it, and so forth). Now imagine an (almost) exact counterpart of Lars - Lars* - who is in exactly the same cognitive state except that he has the extra piece of information that the car was there a minute ago (perhaps he looked). Clearly, Lars* will be in a slightly better epistemic position with respect to his belief that his car is outside than Lars. Although they will, in general, track the truth across the same set of possible worlds, Lars* will track the truth in a few extra possible worlds, such as the possible worlds in which his car was stolen ten minutes ago.

DeRose then goes on to describe the mechanism which changes the conversational context (and thereby alters the epistemic standards at play) in terms of the thesis of Dretskean Sensitivity that we saw above. Recall that for an agent to have a belief in P that is sensitive in this way, the agent must not only have a true belief in P in the actual world, but also not believe P in the nearest possible world (or worlds) in which P is false. DeRose's thought is that in any particular conversational context there is a certain set of propositions that are explicitly at issue and that the agent must, at the very least, be sensitive to all these ‘explicit’ propositions if she is to know them. Moreover, the most demanding of these propositions - the proposition which has a negation that occupies the furthest-out possible world - will set the standard for that conversational context since this not-P world will determine the extent of possible worlds that one’s beliefs must be able to track if one is to be truly said to know a proposition in that context. Knowing a proposition thus involves being in an epistemic position sufficient to track the truth across the range of possible worlds determined by the most demanding proposition explicit to that context. Crucially, however (and I will be expanding upon this detail in a moment), this point also applies to propositions which are implicit to a conversational context (that is, propositions which one believes but which are not explicit to that conversational context). In order to know such a proposition - even if one’s belief in that proposition is not sensitive - one need only be in a sufficient epistemic position to meet the standards of that context. (The importance of this point will soon become apparent).

DeRose then characterises the mechanism that brings about an upward shift in epistemic standards as follows:

When it is asserted that some subject S knows (or does not know) some proposition P, the standards for knowledge (the standards for how good an epistemic position one must be in to count as knowing) tend to be raised, if need be, to such a level as to require S's belief in that particular P to be sensitive for it to count as knowledge. (DeRose 1995, 36)

That is, what changes a conversational context is when a new proposition is made explicit to that context which is more demanding than any of the propositions currently explicit in that context. This will thus increase the range of possible worlds at issue in the determination of knowledge, and thereby increase the strength of epistemic position required in order to be truly said to know.

What motivates this claim is the fact that, as Lewis (1979) famously argued, when it comes to ‘context-sensitive' terms like ‘flat’ or ‘knowledge’, the conversational ‘score’ tends to change depending upon the assertions of that context. We may all agree that the table in front of us is ‘flat’ in an everyday context, but, ceteris paribus, if someone enters the room and denies that it is flat we do not thereby disagree with her. Instead, we take it that she means ‘flat’ in some more demanding sense and so raise the standards for ‘flatness’ so as to make her assertion true (this is what Lewis (1996, 559) calls a "rule of accommodation"). That is, we take it that the new participant of our conversational context means flat in some more restricted sense so that the barely perceptible bumps on the table before us are sufficient to make the claim "This table is flat" false. DeRose considers the Lewis line to have captured something intuitive about the pragmatics of how we use our ‘context-sensitive’ terms and, moreover, believes that epistemic terms such as ‘knowledge’ behave in a similar way.

An example will help clarify matters here. Imagine an agent in a quotidian context in which only everyday propositions, such as whether or not one is currently having dinner with one's brother (P), or whether or not the garden gate has been closed (Q), are at issue. Sensitivity to these everyday propositions will only require the consideration of nearby possible worlds and thus the strength of epistemic position demanded will be very weak. Let us say, plausibly, that the possible world in which one is not having dinner with one’s brother is ‘further-out’ than the possible world in which the garden gate is not closed. This proposition will thus determine the range of possible worlds at issue in the determination of knowledge in that conversational context. Let us further suppose that the agent in question does have a sensitive belief in this proposition. The issue of what other propositions the subject knows will now be decided by whether the agent’s belief in those propositions will track the truth across the range of possible worlds determined by not-P. If, for instance, the agent’s belief that the garden gate is closed matches the truth as to whether Q in all of the possible worlds within that range, then she will know Q. Equally, however, if the subject’s belief in a proposition which is implicit to that conversational context tracks the truth across this range of possible worlds then that proposition will be known also, even if the agent’s belief in that proposition is not sensitive.

Consider, for instance, the agent's belief that she is not a BIV, a proposition which, as we saw above, one cannot be sensitive to because in the nearest BIV-world one still believes that one is not a BIV. On the contextualist model, however, if one is in a conversational context in which such a proposition is not explicit, then one can know this proposition just so long as one has a belief as to whether this proposition is true which matches the facts as to whether it is true within the range of possible worlds at issue. And, clearly, this demand will be trivially satisfied in the above scenario where the subject has a sensitive belief in the ordinary proposition, P. After all, insofar as one has such a sensitive belief in P, then it must be the case that the BIV skeptical world is, modally speaking, far-out, for if it weren’t, then this would affect the sensitivity of the subject’s beliefs in ordinary propositions like P. Accordingly, on this view, all the subject needs in this context is a stubborn belief that she is not a BIV in order to be truly said to know this proposition in this conversational context. The contextualist can thus capture the second element of the ‘phenomenology’ of our engagement with skepticism that we noted above - that, in quotidian conversational contexts, we are perfectly willing to ascribe knowledge of everyday propositions and also feel that we must know the denials of skeptical hypotheses as well.

One might wonder why I use the word ‘feel' here. Well, the reason is that, on the contextualist account, if one were to explicitly mention these anti-skeptical propositions (as one would if one were to verbally ascribe knowledge of them to oneself), then one would thereby make that proposition explicit to the conversational context and so change the epistemic standards needed for knowledge accordingly. In order to have knowledge that one is not a BIV within the new conversational context, one’s belief that one is not a BIV must now exhibit sensitivity (which, as we saw above, is impossible), and the possible worlds relevant to the determination of that sensitivity will be relevant to one’s knowledge of even everyday propositions. Accordingly, one will now lack knowledge both of the denial of the skeptical hypothesis (because one’s belief in this respect is not sensitive), and of the everyday propositions (since even though one’s beliefs in these propositions are sensitive, one can never be in an epistemic position that would support knowledge of them which would be strong enough to track the truth in far-off BIV-worlds). The contextualist thus claims to have captured the other two aspects of the ‘phenomenology’ of our engagement with skepticism - that we are completely unwilling to ascribe knowledge in skeptical conversational contexts, and that this is even so when the only thing that may have changed from the non-skeptical conversational context in which we were willing to ascribe knowledge is the course of the conversation. Moreover, the contextualist has done this without either conceding the universal truth of skepticism (since skepticism is false in everyday contexts), or denying closure (since there is no single context in which one both knows an everyday proposition whilst lacking knowledge of the denial of a skeptical hypothesis). Accordingly, DeRose claims to have ‘solved’ the skeptical paradox in an entirely intuitive manner.

The semantic contextualist proposals made by Lewis, Cohen and others run along similar lines to the DeRose thesis. The key difference between DeRose and Lewis is that Lewis cashes-out his thesis in terms of a series of rules which determine when we may and may not properly ignore a certain error-possibility rather than in terms of a general modal account of knowledge. The key difference between Cohen's position and that advanced by Lewis and DeRose is that it is centred upon the concept of justification rather than knowledge and incorporates a certain view about the structure of reasons (Cohen 1999; 2000). That the DeRose view differs in these ways from the views presented by Lewis and Cohen may work in its favour. As Timothy Williamson (2001) has pointed out, DeRose’s more straightforward position may be insulated from the kind of ad hoc charges regarding Lewis’ employment of numerous rules governing when an error-possibility is properly ignored, (as put forward, for example, by Williams (2001)). Moreover, the stress on justification in Cohen’s account can make it unappealing to those who find such a notion problematic, at least insofar as it is understood as playing an essential role in knowledge acquisition. There are thus prima facie grounds for thinking that if any semantic contextualist theory will work, then it will be one run along the lines presented by DeRose.

In any case, the most interesting objections against semantic externalism do not rest upon specific elements of the particular versions of this position, but rather strike against the general approach. Perhaps the most obvious concern facing semantic contextualism is that its claim that the epistemic status of an agent's beliefs can be variable in response to mere conversational factors is highly contentious. For instance, contra Cohen’s (1991) contextualist characterisation of his RA position, Dretske writes:

Knowledge is relative, yes, but relative to the extra-evidential circumstances of the knower and those who, like the knower, have the same stake in what is true in the matter in question. Knowledge is context sensitive, according to this view, but it is not indexical. If two people disagree about what is known, they have a genuine disagreement. They can't both be right. (Dretske 1991, 191)

That is, Dretske rejects outright the thought that the truth-value of a knowledge claim can be dependent upon anything other than what the concrete features of the situation are. I won't undertake a detailed discussion of this line of attack against semantic contextualism here, however, since the semantic contextualist proposal is clearly meant to be understood as a revisionistic proposal in this respect. Indeed, this is to be expected given that, as we have already seen, any plausible anti-skeptical proposal will have to deny some claim that is otherwise thought to be intuitive (Dretske himself denies closure, for example). To query this element of the thesis alone is thus not to give it a run for its money (although, if one can couple this line of critique with other concerns then it can carry some dialectical weight).

The other more general lines of criticism against semantic contextualism fall into three main camps. First, there is the allegation that semantic contextualism leaves us no better off than we were before. Second, there is the worry about how the contextualist is to explain our knowledge (albeit only in quotidian contexts) of the denials of skeptical hypotheses. After all, as we noted above, we do have a strong intuition that we can never know such propositions in any context (recall that this intuition was one of the motivating factors behind the Dretskean theory). Third, there is the claim that semantic contextualism is guilty of over-kill in its approach to skepticism in that it essentially incorporates a claim which would suffice to undermine radical skepticism by itself (i. e., regardless of whether it is combined with a general contextualist thesis). Accordingly, on this view, contextualism is both unnecessary and ill-motivated.

The worry that motivates the first concern is that what semantic contextualism does concede to the skeptic is the ‘hierarchical' structure of her doubts. That is, on the semantic contextualist view the skeptic is indeed working at a high epistemic standard, one that is more demanding than our everyday standards. The problem with conceding this much to the skeptic is that it appears to legitimate the concern that the skeptic’s standards are the right standards, and thus that, although we are content to ascribe everyday knowledge in quotidian contexts, we ought not to ascribe such knowledge because, strictly speaking, we lack knowledge relative to the proper skeptical standards that should be employed (see Pritchard 2001a for a development of this problem). This line of thought should be familiar as the general infallibilist line that we saw Unger arguing for in §2 and one might think that one could dismiss it on the same grounds that were canvassed there. Matters are not quite so simple, however. Indeed, it is interesting that in more recent works Unger (1984; 1986) has toned down his commitment to infallibilism in favour of a different conception of the skeptical debate which argues that there is nothing to tell between the contextualist reading of our epistemic concepts and what he calls ‘invariantism’, which would license infallibilist conclusions. Unger’s point here is that all contextualism can achieve is, at best, a kind of impasse with the skeptic such that we know that one of these views must be right but where we are unable to definitively determine which. Is it that the standards are high and only seem variable because we are content to talk loosely in everyday contexts (in which case the infallibilist, and thus the skeptic, is right), or is it that our epistemic concepts are genuinely variable and thus that we do have knowledge relative to low everyday epistemic standards (in which case the contextualist is right and the skeptic is wrong)? The skeptical thought that arises here is that if we are unable to offer sufficient reasons for preferring the latter scenario over the former then contextualism does not put us in a better situation than we were in before.

The second worry - that contextualism is unable to explain how we can have knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses - is particularly striking because if this claim holds then semantic contextualism does not even supply us with an impasse with the skeptic. Instead, the position would simply be incoherent. The thought here is that since our, presumably empirical, knowledge in this respect cannot be coherently thought of as being the result of an empirical investigation, hence we cannot make sense of it at all. Perhaps the bravest response to this line of attack in the recent literature can be found in the suggestion made by both Cohen (1999; 2000) and DeRose (2000) that it might be possible to understand an agent's knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses along a priori lines. Cohen motivates this thought relative to what he terms the "a priori rationality" of denying skeptical error-possibilities (e.g. Cohen 2000, 104), whilst DeRose employs Putnamian reflections on semantic externalism as a means of showing how we might have a priori knowledge of empirical truths.

Even if these lines of argument could be made palatable, however, a further line of attack (the third worry listed above) would instantly emerge. For if we can indeed make sense of our putative knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses then what could the motivation for an epistemologically revisionist thesis like contextualism possibly be? After all, the epistemological revisionism incorporated in contextualism only seemed necessary because our knowledge of these propositions seemed so insecure. If we can have knowledge of these propositions, however, then why not simply motivate one's anti-skepticism by straightforwardly denying the first premise of the skeptical argument, (S1), rather than by going contextualist? We will return to consider this kind of anti-skeptical proposal - known as the ‘Neo-Moorean’ view - in more detail in §5.

4. "Hinge" Propositions and Inferential Contextualism

Before we look at this neo-Moorean approach to radical skepticism, however, it is worthwhile to first consider two lines of argument which, at least superficially, might appear to be analogue approaches to that of the Dretskean and semantic contextualist line. Where these anti-skeptical approaches differ, in the first instance at least, from those just canvassed, is that they primarily take their stimulus not from the RA debate but from Wittgenstein's last notebooks (published as On Certainty) which were on the topic of knowledge and skepticism.

Both of these accounts focus upon the Wittgensteinian notion of a "hinge proposition", though they each use the notion in a different way. The first camp, which includes such figures as Peter Strawson (1985), Crispin Wright (1985; 1991; 2000), Hilary Putnam (1992) and Avrum Stroll (1994) might be considered to be offering the purest hinge proposition thesis because for them the notion is the primary unit upon which their anti-skepticism rests. In contrast, the conception of this notion employed by Williams (1991) is developed along explicitly contextualist lines. Interestingly, however, the type of contextualism that emerges is not of a semantic variety. I will consider each of these views in turn. First, however, we need to look a little at what Wittgenstein had in mind in his employment of this notion.

Wittgenstein describes hinge propositions as follows:

[...] the questions that we raise and our doubts depend upon the fact that some propositions are exempt from doubt, are as it were like hinges on which those turn.

That is to say, it belongs to the logic of our scientific investigations that certain things are in deed not doubted.

But it isn't that the situation is like this: We just can’t investigate everything, and for that reason we are forced to rest content with assumption. If I want the door to turn, the hinges must stay put. (Wittgenstein 1969 §§341-3)

As this quotation indicates, what is odd about these propositions is that, unlike other seemingly empirical propositions, our belief in them does not seem to either stand in need of evidential buttress or, for that matter, be legitimately prone to coherent doubt. And this property is not explained merely by the fact that these propositions are "in deed not doubted", since the situation is rather that we do not doubt them because, in some sense, we ought not to doubt them. Even despite their lack of sufficient evidential support, their immunity to coherent doubt is part of "the logic of our scientific investigations."

In proposing this notion Wittgenstein was explicitly challenging the conventional epistemological wisdom that a belief is only legitimately held if it is sufficiently evidentially grounded (otherwise it is open to legitimate doubt), and that no belief in an empirical proposition is beyond coherent doubt should the grounds for that belief be found wanting. In particular, Wittgenstein's remarks here were primarily targeted at G. E. Moore’s (1925; 1939) famous "common-sense" response to the skeptic. In effect, what Moore did was reverse the skeptical train of reasoning by arguing, on the basis of his conviction that the skeptical conclusion must be false, that he did know the denial of the relevant skeptical hypothesis after all. In general, the Moorean response to the skeptic is to respond to the skeptic’s modus ponens argument with the corresponding modus tollens.

Wittgenstein claimed that where Moore went wrong was in treating a hinge proposition as if it were just a normal empirical proposition. In particular, he focussed upon Moore's use of the everyday proposition ‘I have two hands’ in this respect, arguing that this is, in normal circumstances, a hinge proposition and thus that the certainty that we attach to it is not due to any evidence that we might have for its favour but rather reflects the fact that in those circumstances it is what ‘stands fast’ in our assessment of other propositions. Nothing is more certain that this proposition in ordinary circumstances, and thus no other belief could be coherently regarded as providing support for it or be coherently thought to undermine it. As Wittgenstein puts the matter at one point:

My having two hands is, in normal circumstances, as certain as anything that I could produce in evidence for it.

That is why I am not in a position to take the sight of my hand as evidence for it. (Wittgenstein 1969 §250)

Given that this is so, however, Moore cannot use the certainty he has for this proposition in order to derive support for his belief in the denials of skeptical hypotheses since, strictly speaking, his belief in this proposition is not grounded at all. Indeed, Wittgenstein goes further to argue that, insofar as Moore regards this proposition as being grounded by the evidence he has for it, then the circumstances are no longer ‘normal' in the relevant respects and thus the proposition is no longer a hinge proposition. And in these conditions, it would be ridiculous to try to buttress one’s belief in the denials of skeptical hypotheses with the support that one has for this proposition (Wittgenstein (1969, §20) compares it to basing one’s belief in the existence of the external world on the grounds one has for thinking that there are other planets).

Wittgenstein is not endorsing radical skepticism by attacking Moore in this way, for the general anti-skeptical line that emerges is that where the skeptic, like Moore, goes wrong is in considering certain basic propositions as being coherently open to doubt. In doing so, or so the argument runs, she fails to pay due attention to the pivotal role that certain, apparently ordinary, propositions can play in our systems of beliefs and thus to the manner in which even everyday propositions can be held with conviction without thereby standing in need of a corresponding degree of evidential buttress.

So construed, the hinge proposition line is largely a diagnosis of why we are so tempted by skeptical arguments rather than a refutation of the skeptical argument. Indeed, in the hands of Strawson (1985), Putnam (1992), and Stroll (1994) this is what the hinge proposition line is largely designed to do. So construed, however, it is difficult to see what comfort it offers. After all, it is far from clear that it results in the denial of any of the intuitions that we saw at issue in our formulation of the skeptical argument in §1. In particular, this diagnostic thesis neither results in the denial of closure nor in a contextualist thesis. Moreover, the standard hinge proposition line explicitly allows that hinge propositions are not known, strictly speaking, since they fall outside of the ambit of epistemic evaluation (being instead the nodes around which epistemic evaluation takes place). The anti-skeptical import of the basic hinge proposition line is thus moot.

In the hands of Wright (1985; 1991; 2000) and Williams (1991), however, one finds a much stronger version of this approach. I will focus on each in turn. In effect, Wright argues that doubting hinge propositions does not merely reflect a misunderstanding of the epistemological landscape, rather it also leads to intellectual self-subversion. The most sophisticated of these arguments can be found in Wright (1991), where he attempts to show that dreaming skepticism must be unsound because it leads to a more radical form of doubt which undermines the very presuppositions that the skeptic needs to employ in order to get her dreaming skepticism off the ground. Thus, dreaming skepticism is necessarily intellectually self-subverting and thus it can be disregarded with impunity. What this line adds to the previous approaches is a principled epistemic ground for discounting the skeptic's doubt. In particular, since it is epistemically irrational to doubt the hinge propositions in question, the implication of the argument that Wright offers is that we can indeed know the denials of skeptical hypotheses on the basis of our knowledge of everyday propositions even though our belief in the former is not evidentially grounded. As Wright (1991, 107-8) puts the point, "the impossibility of earning a warrant that one is not now dreaming does not imply that no such warrant is ever possessed."

Although Wright does succeed in at least showing how the diagnosis of radical skepticism that the hinge proposition line offers might lead to a refutation of the skeptical argument, a number of problems with his approach remain. One worry concerns the examples of hinge propositions that he uses. Whereas Wittgenstein seemed to have everyday propositions in mind in his use of this notion (and ‘I have two hands' in particular), Wright’s argument only works if one takes the denials of skeptical hypotheses as hinge propositions, a move that receives only ambiguous support in the text. A more serious worry concerns how, exactly, we are to cash-out this idea that the warrant which underpins our putative knowledge of the denials of hinge propositions can be "unearned" in the fashion that Wright envisages (see Pritchard 2001c). After all, the idea that we could have knowledge of these propositions purely because we have knowledge of everyday propositions does seem to be question begging. Again, then, the worry about closure in the context of the skeptical debate is brought to the fore. The intuition that closure holds leads us to think that an anti-skeptical theory must incorporate the claim that we can know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, even though such knowledge bears few, if any, of the usual hallmarks of empirical knowledge. This tension can only be resolved by either denying closure or allowing that we can know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, but each of these moves raises tensions of its own.

Wright responds to this latter worry in more recent work. Drawing upon remarks made by Martin Davies (1998), Wright (2000) argues that we need to distinguish between the principle of closure and what he terms the principle of "transmission". In essence, his way around this concern about closure is to maintain that whilst knowledge does indeed transfer across known entailments as closure demands, it does not transmit, where transmission requires something more demanding. In particular, transmission demands that the "cogency" of the argument be preserved, which is its aptitude to produce rational conviction. Here is Wright:

A cogent argument is one whereby someone could be moved to rational conviction of the truth of its conclusion. (Wright 2000, 140)

So Wright's thought is that if one does know the everyday propositions then, trivially, one must know the denials of skeptical hypotheses that are known to be entailed by those propositions. Nevertheless, that closure holds in these cases does not mean that any argument that attempts to establish anti-skeptical knowledge on this basis will be apt to convince a third party. After all, notes Wright, the argument is question begging in the relevant respect since it is only by taking for granted the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses (that is, by taking the relevant hinge propositions for granted) that the agent is able to have knowledge of the everyday propositions in the first place. This is a compelling move to make since it diagnoses the arguments against closure by characterising them in terms of how what is lacking from the conclusion is not knowledge but something just as valuable, a conclusion that is apt to convince. It also explains the failure of the Moorean approach, for where Moore goes wrong is not in lacking the knowledge that he claims to have, but rather in attempting to secure any conviction on the part of his audience by offering his argument. Indeed, this is a very Wittgensteinian claim to make since Wittgenstein himself argues that:

Moore's mistake lies in this - countering the assertion that one cannot know that, by saying "I do know it". (Wittgenstein 1969, §521, my italics)

As this quotation implies, the problem with Moore's argument is precisely not the falsity of the conclusion (which would be to validate either radical skepticism or the denial of closure), but rather concerns the manner in which he proposes it and the ends that it is designed to serve.

Still, compelling though this approach is, we are still in need of an account of knowledge which can explain how it is that we can know such propositions as the denials of skeptical hypotheses, something which Wright himself does not offer (see Pritchard 2002a for more on this point). For this contribution to the anti-skeptical debate we must look elsewhere. I will consider such an account in a moment, for one could view the neo-Moorean strategy as presenting the required analysis. First, however, I will briefly mention another influential reading of the hinge proposition thesis, due to Williams (1991).

As might be expected, what identifies Williams' inferential thesis as a contextualist account is that it incorporates the claim that one should understand knowledge relative to a context of some description. Like the semantic contextualist view put forward by DeRose et al, Williams argues that certain error-possibilities are only epistemically relevant, and thus potentially knowledge defeating, in certain contexts. Moreover, Williams is also keen to retain the closure principle. He does so on contextualist grounds, arguing that provided one keeps to the one context then closure will hold. As with the semantic contextualist position, then, apparent failures of closure are simply due to equivocations between different contexts.

The Williams line thus shares a central core of claims with the semantic contextualist view. Nevertheless, their disagreements are significant. The two main areas of disparity between the two theories are as follows. First, Williams does not individuate contexts along a ‘conversational' axis, but rather in terms of the inferential structure of that context (hence the name, inferential contextualism). Second (and as we will see this point is closely related to the inferential thesis), Williams does not allow a context-independent hierarchy of contexts. That is, unlike the semantic contextualists, Williams does not, for example, regard the skeptical context as being a more epistemically demanding context. Rather, it is just a context which employs a different epistemic structure.

Indeed, on Williams' view, contextualism just is the thesis that there is no such hierarchy of epistemic contexts - instead, each context is, epistemically speaking, autonomous. To think otherwise is, he thinks, to fall victim to the doctrine of "epistemological realism" - the view that the objects of epistemological inquiry have an inherent, and thus context-independent, structure. In contrast, the inferential contextualism that he advances is defined as the denial of this thesis. It holds that:

[...] the epistemic status of a given proposition is liable to shift with situational, disciplinary and other contextually variable factors: it is to hold that, independently of such influences, a proposition has no epistemic status whatsoever. (Williams 1991, 119)

And Williams is quite clear that this last phrase "has no epistemic status whatsoever" is meant to indicate that there is no context-independent means by which we can evaluate the standards wrought in different contexts. He describes his view as a "deflationary" theory of knowledge, in that it holds that there need be nothing that ties all instances of knowledge together other than the fact that they are instances of knowledge. He writes:

A deflationary account of "know" may show how the word is embedded in a teachable and useful linguistic practice, without supposing that "being known to be true" denotes a property that groups propositions into a theoretically significant kind. We can have an account of the use and utility of "know" without supposing that there is such a thing as human knowledge. (Williams 1991, 113)

It is as a consequence of such a view that the very validity of the epistemological enterprise, at least as it is commonly understood, is called into question:

If we give up the idea of pervasive, underlying epistemological constraints; if we start to see the plurality of constraints that inform the various special disciplines, never mind ordinary, unsystematic factual discourse, as genuinely irreducible; if we become suspicious of the idea that "our powers and faculties" can be evaluated independently of everything having to do with the world and our place in it: then we lose our grip on the idea of "human knowledge" as an object of theory. (Williams 1991, 106)

And to say that "human knowledge" is not a suitable object of theory is itself to say that the epistemological project cannot be systematically conceived. On Williams' view there is no epistemological analysis to be conducted outside of contextual parameters and, accordingly, there are no context-independent standards either as the semantic contextualist model would suggest.

It is as a consequence of this stance that Williams is forced to concede that the skeptic is perfectly correct in her assessment of our knowledge, but only because she is operating within an epistemic context that utilises a standard which defeats our everyday knowledge. That is, the skeptic's conclusions are correct, but, by being confined to a specific epistemic context, they lack the hegemony that she requires in order to cause the intended epistemic harm. It does not follow from the truth of skepticism that we lack the everyday knowledge that we attribute to ourselves, or even that such knowledge is inferior to the knowledge that the skeptic has in mind (which would, in line with the semantic contextualist view, presuppose a hierarchy). That is:

The skeptic takes himself to have discovered, under the conditions of philosophical reflection, that knowledge of the world is impossible. But in fact, the most he has discovered is that knowledge of the world is impossible under the conditions of philosophical reflection. (Williams 1991, 130)

So whereas the ‘hierarchical' camp of semantic contextualists tend to individuate contexts in terms of a context-transcendent criterion of rigour, Williams’ schema allows no such ordering of contexts. For him, a context is individuated purely in terms of the epistemic structure it endorses - in terms of the inferential relations that obtain between the types of beliefs that that context is interested in. And since no context employs universal standards, this contextual epistemic structure is also identified in terms of what it takes for granted - which propositions it regards as being immune from doubt in terms of that context. Williams calls the defining assumptions of a context of inquiry its "methodological necessities", and this notion is explicitly meant to capture the chief insights behind the Wittgensteinian notion of a hinge proposition. When we do history, for example, we take the general veracity of historical documentation for granted, as well as the denials of certain skeptical scenarios such as that the world came into existence five minutes ago replete with the traces of a distant ancestry (the so-called ‘Russellian Hypothesis’). To doubt such methodological necessities (/hinge propositions) is not, he argues, to conduct our historical investigations in a more exacting fashion, but rather to engage in a different sort of investigation altogether, one that is guided by traditional epistemological concerns.

The methodological necessities of the traditional epistemological project which, Williams claims, spawns the skeptical threat, are meant to involve a commitment to this false doctrine of epistemological realism. This leads, he argues, to an antiquated foundationalism, one manifestation of which is the traditional epistemologist's concern with the problem of the external world. This problem is meant to reflect the inadequacy of beliefs of one type - concerning immediate experience - at serving the purpose of epistemically supporting beliefs of another type - concerning material objects in the external world. With the problem so characterised, Williams maintains that it should come as no surprise to find that it is without a solution (there are no beliefs concerning immediate experience that are able to act as epistemic guarantors for beliefs concerning objects in the material world). But, he contends, this need not result in a general external world skepticism because this conception of the inferential ordering needed for warranted beliefs about ‘external’ objects is far from obligatory. In terms of another type of inquiry, such as psychological investigations of perception for example, we may legitimately begin with beliefs about material objects and draw inferences about immediate experience. And since no context has any epistemological ascendancy over any other, the project of justifying psychological beliefs with reference to external world beliefs is just as valid as any epistemological theory which demanded that the inferential relations should point in the opposite direction.

Williams' inferentialist contextualist view is thus both more radical and more demanding than its semantic counterpart. On the one hand, it is more radical because Williams does not concede to the skeptic that her skepticism functions at a higher epistemic standard. Instead, he argues that such skepticism merely reflects a different, and faulty, conception of the epistemological landscape. Williams’ view therefore evades one strand of criticism that we saw levelled at the semantic contextualist account above. On the other hand, it is more demanding because, for related reasons, Williams does not believe that mere changes in the conversational context can suffice to bring about a different epistemic context. Instead, there must be an actual difference in the inferential structure that is employed, and thus, given his contextualism, a difference in what is being taken for granted relative to what. Nevertheless, inferential contextualism may well carry with it even more troubling problems of its own, not least the worry that this approach is allied to a general quietistic philosophical approach. Critical appraisal of this theory has been limited, however, since this variant of the contextualist thesis has tended to be obscured by its semantic counterpart (though see Putnam 1998). As the dust settles on the current wave of discussion of the semantic contextualist proposal, one would expect this distinctive thesis to gain a greater degree of attention.

5. Neo-Moorean Responses to Skepticism

Back, then, to Wright, or, more specifically, to what was absent in Wright's account, viz., an analysis of knowledge that could account for the conclusions that he presents. In essence, what Wright is offering is a neo-Moorean response to skepticism in that he allows, with Moore, that if we do know everyday propositions then we must know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses that are known to be entailed by them. Where Wright differs from Moore is in not allowing that one can coherently argue to this conclusion in any way that could secure rational conviction. Like Moore, however, Wright fails to supplement this account with an analysis of knowledge that would support it. In so doing, Wright is failing to properly engage with other proponents of the debate regarding radical skepticism - such as Dretske, Nozick and DeRose - who do supplement their anti-skeptical account with an analysis of knowledge (albeit, perhaps, only a partial one) that backs-up their theory. Although Wright does not offer such an account, however, there are analyses of knowledge in the literature that might provide support for his view, and it is to these analyses that we now turn.

Recall that the Dretskean line made Dretskean Sensitivity an essential component of knowledge, where this demanded that an agent should have a belief which is not only true, but which ‘tracks' the truth of the proposition in question in the nearest possible world in which that proposition is false, no matter how ‘far-off’, modally speaking, that world is. It was this element of the thesis that secured the skeptic’s first premise, (S1), because no-one’s belief in the denial of a radical skeptical hypothesis could track the truth in this sense. Similarly, DeRose also made Dretskean Sensitivity relevant to knowledge, albeit only as regards those propositions that were at issue in that context. Accordingly, in skeptical conversational contexts where skeptical hypotheses were at issue agents lacked knowledge of these propositions. What both of these anti-skeptical approaches have in common is thus that they allow that, at least in some contexts, we can lack knowledge of the denials of ‘far-off’ skeptical error-possibilities (and thus that the first premise of the skeptical argument, (S1), is true, at least in some contexts).

In contrast to these lines of thought, Ernest Sosa (1999; 2000) has argued that we should instead regard what he terms "safety" as being central to knowledge rather than sensitivity. In essence, he characterises this notion as follows (Sosa 1999, 142):


In all near-by possible worlds, if an agent believes P, then P is true.

Similar proposals have also been put forward by Mark Sainsbury (1997), Williamson (2000a; 2000b, chapter 8), and Duncan Pritchard (2002c; cf. Pritchard 2001a; 2001b; 2002a). The anti-skeptical advantage that this kind of proposal offers over both the Dretskean line and either of the contextualist views that we have discussed is that it allows one to endorse a version of the Moorean proposal which neither issues in the denial of closure nor results in contextualism.

Take the former point first. What prompted the denial of closure was the fact that, if we take sensitivity as a necessary condition on knowledge, then we must allow that a subject can know everyday propositions whilst being unable to know all the known consequences of those everyday propositions - i.e., the denials of skeptical hypotheses. In contrast, on this view we can allow both that agents have knowledge of everyday propositions and that they can know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses. Suppose, for example, that the agent does have a safe belief in an everyday proposition. Not only is this belief true in the actual world, but, across the range of near-by possible worlds where she believes this proposition, it is true there as well. Insofar as this belief really is safe, however, then there will not be any skeptical possible worlds in the realm of near-by possible worlds which determine that safety (henceforth, the "realm of safety"). For if there were such worlds present in the realm of safety, then this would suffice to undermine the agent's knowledge of the everyday proposition since there would then be a near-by possible world in which the agent still believes the everyday proposition but where this proposition is false (because the skeptical hypothesis is true). But since skeptical possible worlds are now excluded from the realm of safety, it follows that the agent must also have a safe belief that she is not a BIV (or, indeed, the victim of any skeptical hypothesis). The reason for this is that there will be no possible world within the realm of safety in which this proposition is false, and thus, in every world in the realm of safety in which she believes this proposition (which, I take it, is all of them), her belief is true. Accordingly, skepticism is evaded and closure, as least as it functions in skeptical and anti-skeptical reasoning, is retained.

Moreover, the adoption of safety as a necessary condition on knowledge is also able to speak to the core relevant alternatives thought that we saw in §2. As expressed there, the thought was that I should be able to have knowledge without having to consider far-fetched, and therefore irrelevant, error-possibilities. This was supposed to be the intuition that Dretske was trying to accommodate with his modal account of knowledge, but, as we saw, he in fact ended up with a slightly different view which did make far-fetched error-possibilities relevant to knowledge, albeit only knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses (note that it was this element of the view that resulted in the denial of closure). In contrast, a modal interpretation of the RA approach that is much closer to this core intuition is that knowledge (any knowledge) is only dependent upon one's ability to track the truth in the relevant range of near-by possible worlds, not also in worlds far away. Accordingly, if the skeptical possibility is indeed far-fetched then it ought to be unable to influence my knowledge of everyday propositions or, for that matter, my knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses. Safety captures this intuition by allowing agents to have knowledge in both cases provided skeptical possible worlds do not feature in the realm of safety. Dretskean Sensitivity, in contrast, violates this intuition by making knowledge dependent not just on the relevant circumstances in near-by worlds but also on the circumstances that obtain in far-off worlds (such as skeptical worlds) where the target proposition is false.

Furthermore, since the realm of safety does not vary in response to mere conversational factors, it follows that this is not a semantic contextualist thesis. If the agent does indeed know everyday propositions then, in line with the central Moorean contention, she will also know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses, and this will be so no matter what conversational context the agent is in. We thus have a Moorean variety of anti-skepticism which, whilst keeping to the RA spirit of both the Dretskean and the semantic contextualist proposals, lacks the epistemological revisionism of either.

This is a compelling account of how a neo-Moorean proposal might run, and it certainly does seem to present one very plausible way of reading the core RA thesis. It is not quite as novel as it may at first seem, however, since one can trace the beginnings of such view in Gail C. Stine's critical appraisal of the Dretskean thesis back in 1976. She noted that so long as one sticks to the core RA conception of relevance then the proper conclusion to be extracted is precisely that we shouldn’t concede a lack of knowledge of the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses, and thus reject closure. Instead, the conclusion we should draw is that, since such skeptical error-possibilities are indeed modally far-off, and thus irrelevant, it follows that we do know their denials after all (insofar as we know anything much) and thus that closure remains intact. Stine thus reaches a similar conclusion to Sosa’s, though without employing the technical modal machinery that Sosa adduces. It is interesting to note, however, that Stine recognised problems with this proposal that Sosa does not mention. In particular, she saw that the difficulty facing this brand of RA thesis is to explain how it can be that closure holds and thus that we do know the denials of anti-skeptical hypotheses after all, a problem that we also saw facing the semantic contextualist account above. As Stine herself admits, such a conclusion does indeed "sound odd". In defence of her position she argues that this ‘oddness’ is not due to what is said being false, however (as the Dretske-Nozick line would suggest), but rather concerns the kind of false conversational implicatures that such a claim to know generate.

Although Stine does not develop this move, it is clearly a manœuvre that has a lot of mileage in it since it confronts head-on the worries about the lack of diagnostic appeal of the neo-Moorean approach. After all, one of the advantages of both the Dretskean and the semantic contextualist line is that they can explain the intuitive appeal of radical skepticism without succumbing to it. The neo-Moorean approach, in contrast, seems to make it a mystery as to why we were ever taken in by this fallacious line of reasoning in the first place. Thus, if it could be shown that the skeptic plays on pragmatic features of our language-games with epistemic terms in order to make her arguments superficially plausible, then we could supplement the neo-Moorean theory with a powerful diagnostic account which explains the phenomenology of our engagement with radical skepticism.

Just such an account is offered in Pritchard (2002c; cf. Pritchard 2001b; 2002a). Pritchard claims that we can strengthen Sosa's account of knowledge whilst keeping true to the basic intuition that drives that notion (he offers an account of knowledge based on the notion of "super-safety"). Moreover, he goes on to show that the kind of mechanisms employed by the semantic contextualist account could just as well be regarded as mechanisms which govern the appropriate assertion of knowledge claims rather than as mechanisms which influence the truth-conditions of what is claimed. For example, the thought is that in skeptical conversational contexts it is the standards for correct assertion of knowledge claims that is raised (rather than the standards for knowledge), and that this fact explains why it is that we are reluctant to ascribe knowledge in skeptical contexts even though we are happy to ascribe such knowledge in quotidian contexts. Accordingly, the idea is that semantic contextualism, construed as a thesis about the fluctuating propriety conditions of knowledge claims, could actually be put into the service of the neo-Moorean view to offer the required diagnostic account. Indeed, elsewhere Pritchard (2001b) argues that a similar view can be extracted from some of Wittgenstein’s remarks on "hinge" propositions, so this view may well represent the beginnings of a thesis which integrates the two branches of recent work as regards skepticism. Moreover, Pritchard (2002a) also argues that Wright’s distinction between transmission and closure can be recast in terms of a distinction between the transference of knowledge across known entailments simpliciter (closure), and the transference of knowledge across known entailments where the knowledge retains a certain quality that makes it apt for proper assertion. Wright’s intuition about transmission is thus captured within this development of the neo-Moorean model by making use of the pragmatic features of our employment of epistemic terms.

This neo-Moorean approach is so recent that detailed critical assessment of it has not yet appeared. Nevertheless, we can note one possible avenue of discussion here, which is the possibly contentious use that the diagnostic element of this theory makes of the pragmatic/semantic distinction. If this element of the theory could be called into question then this would suffice to scupper the diagnostic component of the theory and thus drastically reduce its plausibility as an anti-skeptical thesis.

6. Epistemological Externalism and the New Skeptics

Before concluding, it is worthwhile to briefly dwell upon those influential figures in the recent epistemological debate who, in contrast to the current mood of optimism that can be found in epistemological discussion of the problem of radical skepticism, are deeply suspicious that any intellectually satisfactory solution could ever be given to this problem. The roots of this movement in the contemporary literature can be traced back to the work of three main figures - Unger (1971; 1975), Barry Stroud (1984; 1989) and Thomas Nagel (1986). We saw Unger's infallibilist defence of skepticism earlier on, so here I will summarise Stroud’s and Nagel’s contribution, and highlight one way in which this variety of ‘meta-skepticism’ currently informs the skeptical debate, particularly as it figures in more recent work by Stroud (1994; 1996) and Richard Fumerton (1990; 1995).

For both Nagel and Stroud, the thought seems to be that there is something in our philosophical quest for objectivity that inexorably leads us to skeptical conclusions. Nagel argues, for instance, that objectivity involves attaining a completely impartial view of reality, one that is not tainted by any particular perspective. We must, he argues, "get outside of ourselves", and thereby achieve the impossible task of being able to "view the world from nowhere from within it" (Nagel 1986, 76). We realise that the initial appearances present to a viewpoint can be unreliable guides to reality and therefore seek to modify our ‘subjective' view with a more ‘objective’ perspective that is tempered by reason and reflection. As Nagel points out, however, the trouble with this approach is that

[...] if initial appearances are not in themselves reliable guides to reality, [then] why should the products of detached reflection be any different? Why aren't they [...] equally doubtful [...]? [...] The same ideas that make the pursuit of objectivity seem necessary for knowledge make both objectivity and knowledge seem, on reflection, unattainable. (Nagel 1986, 76)

We can reconstruct the argument here as follows. We recognise that our initial unmodified ‘subjective' experience of the world is unreliable and therefore should be adapted along ‘objective’ lines by eliminating the ‘subjective’ element. For instance, initial appearances tell us, falsely, that straight sticks suddenly become ‘bent’ when placed in water. Accordingly, we modify our initial ‘subjective’ view with the testimony of ‘objective’ scientific investigation which tells us that the stick in fact stays straight, it is just the light that is bending. However, and here is the crux of the matter as far as Nagel is concerned, why do we regard this modified view as being any more reliable than the completely ‘subjective’ perspective that it replaces? After all, we cannot eliminate every trace of ‘subjectivity’ and thus the problematic component of our conception of reality that engendered the pursuit of objectivity in the first place remains. Consequently, we are both aware of the need for objectivity whilst also recognising that such objectivity is impossible. As a result, according to Nagel, we are condemned to the following pessimistic evaluation of our epistemic capacities:

The search for objective knowledge, because of its commitment to a realist picture, is inescapably subject to skepticism and cannot refute it but must proceed under its shadow. [...] Skepticism [...] is a problem only because of the realist claims of objectivity. (Nagel 1986, 71)

That is, the problem of skepticism

[...] has no solution, but to recognise that is to come as near as we can to living in the light of truth. (Nagel 1986, 231)

Moreover, since these ‘realist' truths concerning objectivity are meant to be inherent in our epistemic concepts, so it is held that this pessimism falls naturally out of any reflective analysis of our epistemic concepts.

Stroud makes similar claims. He writes:

The sceptical philosopher's conception of our position and of his question for an understanding of it [...] is a quest for an objective or detached understanding and explanation of the position we are objectively in. What is seen to be true from a detached ‘external’ standpoint might not correspond to what we take to be the truth about our position when we consider it ‘internally’, from within the practical contexts which give our words their social point. Philosophical scepticism says the two do not correspond; we never know anything about the world around us, although we say or imply that we do hundreds of times a day.

I think we do have a conception of things being a certain way quite independently of their being known or believed or said to be that way by anyone. I think that the source of the philosophical problem of the external world lies somewhere within just such a conception of an objective world or in our desire, expressed in terms of that conception, to gain a certain kind of understanding of our relation to the world. But in trying to describe that conception I think I have relied on nothing but platitudes we would all accept - not about specific ways we all now believe the world to be, but just the general idea of what an objective world or an objective state of affairs would be. If those platitudes about objectivity do indeed express the conception of the world and our relation to it that the sceptical philosopher relies on, and if I am right in thinking that scepticism can be avoided only if that conception is rejected, it will seem that in order to avoid scepticism we must deny platitudes we all accept. (Stroud 1984, 81-2)

And note that if responding to skepticism involves denying "platitudes that we would all accept", then it follows that any adequate response to the problem of radical skepticism is bound to be intellectually unsatisfactory.

One might wonder, however, exactly how such epistemological pessimism is to impact on the kind of anti-skeptical proposals that we have considered in previous sections. After all, nearly all of them results in the denial of some key claim that the skeptic makes, and does so on motivated grounds. In what sense, then, must we accept that these proposals, whatever the details, are all going to be intellectually unsatisfactory?

In more recent discussion, one begins to see the emergence of a more definitive pessimistic line, however, which may well be able to give a more compelling expression to this worry. In general, although the point is not always put in these terms, the complaint is that these recent anti-skeptical approaches offer us, at best, an epistemologically externalist response to skepticism when what we wanted was one that functioned within an epistemologically internalist framework.

Simplifying somewhat, we can take epistemological internalism to consist in the claim that there is some substantive necessary condition for knowledge which depends upon facts that the agent is in a position to know by reflection alone. That is, the internalist insists that meeting an appropriate ‘internal' epistemic condition is necessary for knowledge possession. Externalists, in contrast, demure from this claim and therefore allow that agents might know merely by meeting ‘external’ epistemic conditions. So, for example, externalists tend to allow that small children or unreflective subjects (such as the now notorious, and possibly non-existent, "chicken-sexer") can have knowledge even though they fail to meet an internal epistemic condition. Internalists, in contrast, set the standards for knowledge higher and thus exclude these agents from possessing knowledge (for more on this distinction, see the essays collected in Kornblith (2001)).

It is notable that all of the main anti-skeptical accounts that we have discussed so far have tended to side with externalism. For both Dretske and Nozick, for example, the sensitivity condition is a condition that merely needs to be met by the agent for that agent to be a potential knower - it is not further demanded that the agent should have the relevant reflective access to the facts which determine that sensitivity. Similar remarks apply to the semantic contextualist account, with both DeRose and Lewis endorsing externalist views (though Cohen might be an exception in this respect). Finally, the neo-Moorean accounts offered by Sosa et al are all described in terms of an externalist epistemology. On closer reflection, it is unsurprising that externalism should be so widely endorsed in this way, though the reasons in each case are different.

The Dretskeans need to be externalists because it is far more problematic to deny closure if knowledge is given an internalist construal. If the denial of closure were not contentious enough, to argue that one could have the kind of ‘reflective' knowledge at issue in the internalist account of both the antecedent and the entailment and yet lack it of the consequent just seems plain absurd.

Since both the neo-Mooreans and the contextualists retain closure, it follows that they need not be troubled by this particular motivation for externalism. The driving force behind their adoption of externalism is, in contrast, the fact that they allow (albeit, in the contextualist case, relative to certain contexts) that an agent can have knowledge of the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses. The problem is that this seems to be precisely the sort of knowledge that cannot be possessed under the internalist rubric because skeptical scenarios are, ex hypothesi, phenomenologically indistinguishable from everyday life. Accordingly, it is plausible to suppose that agents are unable to have the required reflective access to the relevant facts that determine the epistemic status of their beliefs when it comes to these propositions.

Despite the current popularity of externalist accounts of knowledge, however, one might be less sanguine about the prospects for an externalist response to the problem of radical skepticism. After all, the skeptical puzzle seems to be one that strikes against the prima facie attraction of an externalist account of knowledge. As we saw Craig in effect arguing in §2, if we cannot tell the difference between being in the world that we think we are in now and a skeptical possible world such as the BIV-world, then of what comfort is it to be told that, provided we are in the world we think we are, we know a great deal? Instead, it would seem that we want some sort of subjective assurance as regards our knowledge that externalist anti-skeptical accounts are not in a position to provide.

It is this line of thinking that ultimately motivates recent work by Stroud (1994; 1996) and Fumerton (1990; 1995). For example, Fumerton makes the following point:

It is tempting to think that externalist analyses of knowledge [...] simply remove one level of the traditional problems of skepticism. When one reads the well-known externalists one is surely inclined to wonder why they are so sanguine about their supposition that our commonplace beliefs are, for the most part, [...] knowledge. [...] Perception, memory, and induction may be reliable processes (in Goldman's sense) and thus given his metaepistemological position we may [... have knowledge of] the beliefs they produce but, the sceptic can argue, we have no reason to believe that these process are reliable and thus even if we accept reliabilism, we have no reason to think that the beliefs they produce [constitute knowledge]. (Fumerton 1990, 63)

In effect, the complaint that Fumerton is giving expression to here is that externalism allows that there are certain conditions on knowledge that we are unable to reflectively determine have obtained. Indeed, Fumerton is more explicit about the focus of his objection when he goes on to write that

[...] the main problem with externalist accounts, it seems to me, just is the fact that such accounts [...] develop concepts of knowledge that are irrelevant. [...] The philosopher doesn't just want true beliefs, or even reliably produced beliefs, or beliefs caused by the facts that make them true. The philosopher wants to have the relevant features of the world directly before consciousness. (Fumerton 1990, 64)

Presumably, to argue that externalist accounts of knowledge are problematic because they fail to demand that the relevant facts should be "directly before consciousness" is simply to complain that such theories make the satisfaction of non-reflectively accessible external epistemic conditions central to knowledge possession.

Fumerton is not the only one to put forward objections to externalism that run along these lines, though he is perhaps the most explicit about what the complaint that he is giving voice to amounts to. For example, a similar argument against externalism seems to be implicit in the following passages from Stroud:

[...] suppose there are truths about the world and the human condition which link human perceptual states and cognitive mechanisms with further states of knowledge and reasonable belief, and which imply that human beings acquire their beliefs about the physical world through the operation of belief-forming mechanisms which are on the whole reliable in the sense of giving them mostly true beliefs. [...] If there are truths of this kind [...] that fact alone obviously will do us no good as theorists who want to understand human knowledge in this philosophical way. At the very least we must believe some such truths; their merely being true would not be enough to give us any illumination or satisfaction. But our merely happening to believe them would not be enough either. We seek understanding of certain aspects of the human condition, so we seek more than just a set of beliefs about it; we want to know or have good reasons for thinking that what we believe about it is true. (Stroud 1994, 297)

It is difficult to understand Stroud's objection here if it is not to be construed along similar lines to that found in the passages from Fumerton cited above. Stroud’s thought seems to be that it is not enough merely to meet the external epistemic conditions that give us knowledge, rather we should also have the special kind of internal access to those conditions that the internalist demands (and perhaps even more than that).

A new debate is thus emerging in the literature which is to some extent orthogonal to the key discussions that we have considered so far since it questions the very presuppositions of those discussions. Future work on the skeptical puzzle will thus enjoin participants to not only meet the skeptical argument in a motivated fashion, but also respond to this meta-epistemological challenge.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Austin, J. L. (1961). ‘Other Minds', reprinted in his Philosophical Papers, (eds.) J. O. Urmson & G. J. Warnock, 44-84, Clarendon Press, Oxford, England.
  • Cohen, S. (1987). ‘Knowledge, Context, and Social Standards', Synthese 73, 3-26.
  • Cohen, S. (1988). ‘How to be a Fallibilist', Philosophical Perspectives 2, 91-123.
  • Cohen, S. (1991). ‘Skepticism, Relevance, and Relativity', Dretske and his Critics, (ed.) B. McLaughlin, 17-37, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Cohen, S. (1999). ‘Contextualism, Skepticism, and the Structure of Reasons', Philosophical Perspectives 13, 57-90.
  • Cohen, S. (2000). ‘Contextualism and Skepticism', Philosophical Issues 10, 94-107.
  • Craig, E. (1989). ‘Nozick and the Sceptic: The Thumbnail Version', Analysis 49, 161-2.
  • Craig, E. (1990). Knowledge and the State of Nature: An Essay in Conceptual Synthesis, Clarendon Press, Oxford, England.
  • Davies, M. (1998). ‘Externalism, Architecturalism, and Epistemic Warrant', Knowing Our Own Minds: Essays on Self-Knowledge, (eds.) C. J. G. Wright, B. C. Smith & C. Macdonald, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • DeRose, K. (1995). ‘Solving the Skeptical Problem', Philosophical Review 104, 1-52.
  • DeRose, K. (2000). ‘How Can We Know that We're Not Brains in Vats?’, The Southern Journal of Philosophy 38, 121-48.
  • Dretske, F. (1970). ‘Epistemic Operators', Journal of Philosophy 67, 1007-23.
  • Dretske, F. (1971). ‘Conclusive Reasons', Australasian Journal of Philosophy 49, 1-22.
  • Dretske, F. (1981). ‘The Pragmatic Dimension of Knowledge', Philosophical Studies 40, 363-78.
  • Dretske, F. (1991). ‘Knowledge: Sanford and Cohen', Dretske and his Critics, (ed.) B. McLaughlin, 185-96, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Fumerton, R. (1990). ‘Metaepistemology and Skepticism', Doubting: Contemporary Perspectives on Skepticism, (eds.) M. D. Roth & G. Ross, 57-68, Kluwer Academic Publishers, Dordrecht, Holland.
  • Fumerton, R. (1995). Metaepistemology and Skepticism, Rowman & Littlefield, Lanham, Maryland.
  • Klein, P. (1981). Certainty, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis.
  • Klein, P. (1995). ‘Skepticism and Closure: Why the Evil Genius Argument Fails', Philosophical Topics 23, 213-36.
  • Kornblith, H. (2001). Epistemology: Internalism and Externalism, (ed.) Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Lewis, D. (1979). ‘Scorekeeping in a Language Game', Journal of Philosophical Logic 8, 339-59.
  • Lewis, D. (1996). ‘Elusive Knowledge', Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74, 549-67.
  • Moore, G. E. (1925). ‘A Defence of Common Sense', Contemporary British Philosophy (2nd series), (ed.) J. H. Muirhead, Allen and Unwin, London, England; reprinted in his Philosophical Papers, Allen & Unwin, London, England (1959).
  • Moore, G. E. (1939). ‘Proof of an External World', Proceedings of the British Academy 25; reprinted in his Philosophical Papers, Allen & Unwin, London, England (1959).
  • Nagel, T. (1986). The View from Nowhere, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Nozick, R. (1981). Philosophical Explanations, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2001a). ‘Contextualism, Scepticism, and the Problem of Epistemic Descent', Dialectica 55, 327-49.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2001b). ‘Radical Scepticism, Epistemological Externalism, and "Hinge" Propositions', Wittgenstein-Studien, 81-105.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2001c). ‘Scepticism and Dreaming', Philosophia 28, 373-90.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2002a). ‘McKinsey Paradoxes, Radical Scepticism, and the Transmission of Knowledge across Known Entailments', Synthese 130, 1-24.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2002b). ‘Radical Scepticism, Epistemological Externalism, and Closure', forthcoming in Theoria 69.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2002c). ‘Resurrecting the Moorean Response to Scepticism', forthcoming in International Journal of Philosophical Studies 10.
  • Putnam, H. (1992). Renewing Philosophy, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.
  • Putnam, H. (1998). ‘Skepticism', Philosophie in Synthetischer Absicht (Synthesis in Mind), (ed.) M. Stamm, 239-68, Klett-Cotta, Stuttguard, Germany.
  • Sainsbury, R. M. (1997). ‘Easy Possibilities', Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 57, 907-19.
  • Sosa, E. (1999). ‘How to Defeat Opposition to Moore', Philosophical Perspectives 13, 141-54.
  • Sosa, E. (2000). ‘Skepticism and Contextualism', Philosophical Issues 10, 1-18.
  • Stine, G. C. (1976). ‘Skepticism, Relevant Alternatives, and Deductive Closure', Philosophical Studies 29, 249-61.
  • Strawson, P. F. (1985). Skepticism and Naturalism: Some Varieties, Methuen, London.
  • Stroll, A. (1994). Moore and Wittgenstein on Certainty, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Stroud, B. (1984). The Significance of Philosophical Scepticism, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Stroud, B. (1989). ‘Understanding Human Knowledge in General', Knowledge and Scepticism, (eds.) M. Clay & K. Lehrer, Westview, Boulder, Colorado.
  • Stroud, B. (1994). ‘Scepticism, ‘Externalism', and the Goal of Epistemology’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (supplementary vol.) 68, 290-307.
  • Stroud, B. (1996). ‘Epistemological Reflection on Knowledge of the External World', Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 56, 345-58.
  • Unger, P. (1971). ‘A Defence of Skepticism', Philosophical Review 80, 198-219.
  • Unger, P. (1975). Ignorance - A Case for Scepticism, Clarendon Press, Oxford, England.
  • Unger, P. (1984). Philosophical Relativity, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Unger, P. (1986). ‘The Cone Model of Knowledge', Philosophical Topics 14, 125-78.
  • Williams, M. (1991). Unnatural Doubts: Epistemological Realism and the Basis of Scepticism, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Williams, M. (2001). ‘Contextualism, Externalism and Epistemic Standards', Philosophical Studies 103, 1-23.
  • Williamson, T. (2000a). ‘Scepticism and Evidence', Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 60, 613-28.
  • Williamson, T. (2000b). Knowledge and Its Limits, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Williamson, T. (2001). ‘Comments on Michael Williams' ‘Contextualism, Externalism and Epistemic Standards'’, Philosophical Studies 103, 24-33.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (1969). On Certainty, (eds.) G. E. M. Anscombe & G. H. von Wright, (tr.) D. Paul & G. E. M. Anscombe, Basil Blackwell, Oxford.
  • Wright, C. (1985). ‘Facts and Certainty', Proceedings of the British Academy 71, 429-72.
  • Wright, C. (1991). ‘Scepticism and Dreaming: Imploding the Demon', Mind 397, 87-115.
  • Wright, C. (2000). ‘Cogency and Question-Begging: Some Reflections on McKinsey's Paradox and Putnam's Proof’, Philosophical Issues 10, 140-63.

Author Information

Duncan Pritchard
University of Stirling
United Kingdom

The Epistemology of Perception

EpisPercPerception is a central issue in epistemology, the theory of knowledge. At root, all our empirical knowledge is grounded in how we see, hear, touch, smell and taste the world around us. In section 1, a distinction is drawn between perception that involves concepts and perception that doesn't, and the various epistemic relations that there are between these two types of perception are discussed--our perceptual beliefs and our perceptual knowledge. Section 2 considers the role of causation in perception and focuses on the question of whether perceptual experience justifies our beliefs or merely causes them. Sections 3 and 4 further investigate the epistemic role of perception and introduce two distinct conceptions of the architecture of our belief system: foundationalism and coherentism. It is shown how perceptual experience and perceptual beliefs are integrated into these systems. Finally, section 5 turns to the externalist view that thinkers need not be aware of what justifies their perceptual beliefs.

Table of Contents

  1. Perception and Belief
    1. Seeing That, Seeing As and Simple Seeing
    2. Perceptual Beliefs
  2. Perception, Justification and Causation
    1. Armstrong's Causal Account of Perceptual Knowledge
  3. Perception and Foundationalism
    1. Traditional Foundationalism
    2. Sellars and the Myth of the Given
    3. Concepts and Experience
    4. Modest Foundationalism
  4. Perception and Coherentism
    1. The Basic Idea Behind Coherentism
    2. Bonjour and the Spontaneous Nature of Perceptual Beliefs
  5. Externalism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Perception and Belief

a. Seeing That, Seeing As and Simple Seeing

Perception is the process by which we acquire information about the world around us using our five senses. Consider the nature of this information. Looking out of your window, you see that it is raining. Your perception represents the world as being like that. To perceive the world in this way, therefore, it is required that you possess concepts, that is, ways of representing and thinking about the world. In this case, you require the concept RAIN. Thus, seeing that your coffee cup is yellow and that the pencil is green involves the possession of the concepts COFFEE CUP, YELLOW, PENCIL and GREEN. Such perception is termed "perceiving that," and is factive; that is, it is presupposed that you perceive the world correctly. To perceive that it is raining, it must be true that it is raining. You can also, though, perceive the world to be a certain way and yet be mistaken. This we can call, "perceiving as," or in the usual case, "seeing as". A stick partly submerged in water may not be bent but, nevertheless, you see it as bent. Your perception represents the stick as being a certain way, although it turns out that you are wrong. Much of your perception, then, is representational: you take the world to be a certain way, sometimes correctly, when you see that the world is thus and so, and sometimes incorrectly, when the world is not how you perceive it to be.

It also seems that there is a form of perception that does not require the possession of concepts (although this claim has been questioned). It is plausible to claim that cognitively unsophisticated creatures, those that are not seen as engaging in conceptually structured thought, can perceive the world, and that at times we can perceptually engage with the world in a non-conceptual way. You can tell that the wasp senses or perceives your presence because of its irascible behavior. When you are walking along the High Street daydreaming, you see bus stops, waste bins, and your fellow pedestrians. You must see them because you do not bump into them, but you do not see that the bus stop is blue or that a certain pedestrian is wearing Wrangler jeans. You can, of course, come to see the street in this way if you focus on the scene in front of you, but the claim here is that there is a coherent form of perception that does not involve such conceptual structuring. Let us call such baseline perceptual engagement with the world, "simple seeing". This perception involves the acquisition of perceptual information about the world, information that enables us to visually discriminate objects and to successfully engage with them, but also information that does not amount to one having a conceptually structured representation of the world. (Dretske, 1969, refers to simple seeing as "non-epistemic" seeing, and refers to 'seeing that' as "epistemic" seeing).

You can, then, simply see the bus stop, or you can see that the bus stop is blue, or you can, mistakenly, see the bus stop as made of sapphire. These are all forms of perceptual experience, ways you have of causally engaging with the world using your sensory apparatus and ways that have a distinctive conscious or "phenomenological" dimension. Seeing in its various forms strikes your consciousness in a certain way, a way that you are now experiencing as you look at your computer screen. This article investigates the causal and epistemic roles of this perceptual experience.

A little more terminology: the term "sensation" can be used to refer to the conscious aspect of perception, but note that one can have such sensations even when one would not be said to be perceiving the world. When hallucinating, for example, one is having the sensations usually characteristic of perceptual experience, even though in such cases one's experience would not be described as perceptual.

Consider how these various kinds of perceptual experience are related to our perceptual beliefs. Perceptual beliefs are those concerning the perceptible features of our environment, and they are beliefs that are grounded in our perceptual experience of the world. The content of such beliefs can be acquired in other ways: You could be told that the bus stop is blue, or you could remember that it is blue. Right now, though, waiting for the bus, you acquire this belief by looking straight at it, and, thus, you have a perceptual belief concerning this particular fact. Just how your perceptual beliefs are grounded in your perceptual experience is a contentious issue. There is certainly a causal relation between the two, but some philosophers also claim that it is perceptual experience that provides justification for our perceptual beliefs. This foundationalist claim is denied by the coherentist (see sections 3 and 4 below).

b. Perceptual Beliefs

First, one does not necessarily come to acquire perceptual beliefs in virtue of simply seeing the world. Simple seeing is something that cognitively unsophisticated creatures can do, creatures such as wasps that do not have more sophisticated beliefs, propositional beliefs. It is plausible, though, that if one sees a certain object as a bus stop, then one would also come to believe that there is a bus stop being seen. In many cases, this is, of course, true, but it is not in all. A famous example is the Muller-Lyer illusion:


The two horizontal lines above look as though they are of different lengths, the upper line being longer than the lower. If we have seen the illusion before, then we do not believe our eyes. Instead, we believe that the lines are the same length (which they are). Here is another case: a habitual user of hallucinogenics may doubt the veracity of all his perceptions; he may not believe anything he sees. His perception, however, amounts to more than simply seeing; he sees the moon as being made of cheese and his cup of tea as grinning up at him. Yet, because of the doubt fostered by his frequent hallucinations, he does not move from seeing the world as being a certain way to believing that it is. In most cases, though, if one sees the world as being a certain way, then one also believes that it is that way. Last, let us return to the notion of "perceiving that." Such perception has a closer relationship with the acquisition of perceptual belief. If one is described as perceiving that the world is a certain way, it is implied that one also believes that the world is so. Here, there isn't room for perception to come apart from belief.

Thus, we have seen that we can be perceptually engaged with the world in various ways. Such engagement can amount to the mere acquisition of perceptual information, the experience of seeing the world as being a certain way, or the possession of the cognitive states of perceiving and believing that it is so. If all goes well, such perceptual beliefs may constitute perceptual knowledge of the world. According to the traditional account, this is when those beliefs are true and when they are justified. Perceptual knowledge consists in knowledge of the perceptible features of the world around us, and it is that which is grounded in our perceptual experience. Again, the nature of this grounding is controversial. Perceptual experience is certainly causally related to perceptual knowledge; foundationalists, however, make the further claim that such experience provides the justification that is constitutive of such knowledge (see section 3). Others, though, including Armstrong (section 2a) and the coherentists (section 4), do not believe perceptual experience plays this justificatory role with respect to perceptual knowledge. The next section considers this key issue of justification.

But consider the issue of skepticism. The skeptical arguments of Descartes (1641) have had an enormous influence on both the history and practice of epistemology. He suggests certain scenarios that threaten to undermine all of our empirical knowledge of the world. It could be that right now you are dreaming. If you were, everything might appear to you just as it currently does; dreams are sometimes very real. It is also possible that a powerful demon might be deliberately deceiving you; there may not be an external world at all, and all your perceptual experience and perceptual beliefs may be simply planted in your mind by this evil entity. Given such scenarios, it is not clear how our perceptual beliefs can be justified and thus, how we can have perceptual knowledge. Any reasons you have for thinking that such beliefs correctly represent the world are undermined by the fact that you could have such beliefs even if the external world did not exist. Since the seventeenth century, epistemology has been trying to find a solution to this Cartesian scepticism. This article simply assumes that we can have justification for our perceptual beliefs and that perceptual knowledge is possible. Given this assumption, the focus is on how we should conceive of such justification.

2. Perception, Justification and Causation

Perceptual experience provides both causal and justificatory grounding for our perceptual beliefs and for our knowledge of the passing show. In this section, we shall start to look at the causal and justificatory relations between perception, belief and knowledge. As was discussed above, our perceptual experience can be conceptually structured: we can see the world as being a certain way, or we can see that it is thus and so. Thus, such experience could be seen as providing justification for our perceptual knowledge in that you could be justified in taking things to have the properties you see them as having. The fact that perceptual experience is conceptual, however, is not sufficient to ensure that your perceptual beliefs are justified. Dave, a friend of yours, sees every tackle made against a player of West Ham United Football Club as a foul. He is not, however, justified in taking this to be true. Often these clashes are simply not fouls; Dave is wrong, and even when he is correct, when he really sees that a foul has been committed, it would seem that his prejudiced observation of the game entails that in these cases he only gets it right through luck, and thus, he is not justified in his belief. The fact, then, that our experience is conceptual does not entail that we have justified perceptual beliefs or knowledge. Section 3 considers what else needs to be said, and investigates an account of how perceptual experience is seen to provide epistemic justification. First, though, consider an account of perceptual knowledge that does not make use of the notion of justification.

a. Armstrong's Causal Account of Perceptual Knowledge

Armstrong (1961 / 1973) claims that perceptual knowledge simply requires that one's perceptual beliefs stand in lawlike relations to the world.

What makes...a belief a case of knowledge? My suggestion is that there must be a lawlike connection between the state of affairs Bap [that a believes p] and the state of affairs that makes 'p' true such that, given Bap, it must be the case that p. (Armstrong, 1973, p. 75)

Crudely, since causal relations are lawlike, if our perceptual and cognitive apparatus is such that it is buzzing flies that cause us to have perceptual beliefs about buzzing flies, then it will be the case that we will have perceptual knowledge of this annoying aspect of our environment when the bees cause the belief. Armstrong calls his account a "thermometer model" of knowledge. We can come to have knowledge of the world just as a thermometer can come to represent its own temperature. In both systems, there is simply a lawlike relation between a property of the world and a property of a representative device (the level of mercury in a thermometer or the state of certain internal cognitive mechanisms of a thinker).

Highlighting the role of perceptual experience, Armstrong claims that:

"perception is nothing but the acquiring of knowledge of, or, on occasions, the acquiring of an inclination to believe in, particular facts about the physical world, by means of our senses," (Armstrong, 1961, p. 105)

He does, however, claim that there is a "contingent connection between perception and certain sorts of sensation," and that this, "may help to explain the special 'feel' of perception," (Armstrong, 1961, p. 112). Conscious sensation, then, is not essential to perception. I could be correctly said to see the road ahead as I drive late at night on the motorway, even though I have "switched off," and appear to be driving on "autopilot." I can see the road because I am still causally acquiring beliefs about the world in front of me by way of my senses. Similarly, cases of blindsight are also bonafide cases of perception. Blindsight patients claim to have a complete lack of visual experience on, for example, their left side, yet they can make reliable reports about shapes and objects that are presented to this side of their perceptual field (they themselves, however, claim that they are merely guessing). They do, then, seem to be acquiring correct beliefs about their environment via a causal engagement between the world and their senses, and thus, they perceive the world even though in such cases the contingent connections with sensation are lost. Thus, on Armstrong's account, perceptual experience is not necessary for perceptual knowledge. When one does have conscious perceptual experiences, these do not play a justificatory role; they are simply causally related to perceptual belief and knowledge. Many, however, find such an account too sparse, in that one's experience does not play any justificatory or epistemic role in the acquisition of perceptual beliefs or knowledge. It is claimed that a more satisfying theory of perception should include an account of why perceptual experience justifies our perceptual beliefs and that we should not be content with simply an account of why we are caused to acquire them. The following theory of perception attempts to include just such an account of justification.

3. Perception and Foundationalism

Foundationalists claim that the superstructure of our belief system inherits its justification from a certain subset of perceptual beliefs upon which the rest sits. These beliefs are termed "basic beliefs." Our belief system, then, is seen as having the architecture of a building. Later, in section 4, we shall see that coherentists take our belief system to be more akin to an ecosystem, with our beliefs mutually supporting each other, rather than relying for their justification on certain crucial foundation stones. There are various versions of this foundationalist approach, two of which are discussed in the next two sections.

a. Traditional Foundationalism

Traditionally the foundations of knowledge have been seen as infallible (they cannot be wrong), incorrigible (they cannot be refuted), and indubitable (they cannot be doubted). For empiricists, these foundations consist in your beliefs about your own experience. Your beliefs are basic and non-basic. Your basic beliefs comprise such beliefs as that you are now seeing a red shape in your visual field, let us say, and that you are aware of a pungent smell. In order to justify your non-basic belief that Thierry Henry is the best striker in Europe, you must be able to infer it from other beliefs, say that he has scored the most goals. The traditional foundationalist claim, however, is that this sort of inferential justification is not required for your basic beliefs. There may not actually be a red object in the world because you may be hallucinating, but, nevertheless, you cannot be wrong about the fact that you now believe that you am seeing something red. Justification for such beliefs is provided by experiential states that are not themselves beliefs, that is, by your immediate apprehension of the content of your sensory, perceptual experience, or what is sometimes termed, "the Given". It is, then, your experience of seeing red that justifies your belief that you are seeing red. Such experience is non-conceptual. It is, though, the raw material which you then go on to have conceptual thoughts about. This conception of the relation between knowledge and experience has had a distinguished history. It was advocated by the British empiricists--Locke, Berkeley and Hume--and by the important modern adherents C. I. Lewis (1946) and R. Chisholm (1989). However, this conception of how your perceptual beliefs are justified has been widely attacked, and the next two sections address the most influential arguments against traditional foundationalism.

b. Sellars and the Myth of the Given

Sellars (1956) provides an extended critique of the notion of the Given. There are two parts to Sellars' argument: first, he claims that knowledge is part of the "logical space of reasons;" and second, he provides an alternative account of "looks talk," or an alternative reading of such claims as "that looks red to me," claims that traditionally have been seen as infallible and as foundations for our perceptual knowledge. According to Sellars, no cognitive states are non-inferentially justified. For him:

"The essential part is that in characterising an episode or a state as that of knowing, we are placing it in the logical space of reasons, of justifying and being able to justify what one says." (Sellars, 1956, p. 76)

Whether we are talking about perceptual or non-perceptual knowledge, we must be able to offer reasons for why we take such claims to be true. To even claim appropriately that I have knowledge that I now seem to be seeing a red shape, I must be able to articulate such reasons as, "since my eyes are working fine, and the light is good, I am right in thinking that I am having a certain sensory experience." As Rorty (1979, chapter 4) argues, justification is essentially a linguistic or "conversational" notion; it must consist in the reasoned recognition of why a particular belief is likely to be true or why one is rightly said to be having a certain experience. If such an account of justification is correct, then the notion of non-inferentially justified basic beliefs is untenable and non-conceptual perceptual experience cannot provide the justification for our perceptual beliefs.

Surely, though, "this looks red to me," cannot be something that I can be wrong about. Such a foundationalist claim seems to be undeniable. Sellars, however, suggests that such wording does not indicate infallibility. One does not say, "This looks red to me," to (infallibly) report the nature of one's experience; rather, one uses such a locution in order to flag that one is unsure whether one has correctly perceived the world.

... when I say "X looks green to me"...the fact that I make this report rather than the simple report "X is green," indicates that certain considerations have operated to raise, so to speak in a higher court, the question 'to endorse or not to endorse.' I may have reason to think that X may not after all be green. (Sellars, 1956, p. 41)

Thus, Sellars provides a two-pronged attack on traditional foundationalism. The way we describe our perceptual experience does indeed suggest that we have infallible access to certain private experiences, private experiences that we cannot be mistaken about. However, we should recognize the possibility that we may be being fooled by grammar here. Sellars gives an alternative interpretation of such statements as, "this looks red to me," an interpretation that does not commit one to having such a privileged epistemological access to one's perceptual experience. Further, a conceptual analysis of "knowledge" reveals that knowledge is essentially a rational state and, therefore, that one cannot claim to know what one has no reason for accepting as true. Such reasons must be conceived in terms of linguistic constructions that one can articulate, and thus, the bare presence of the Given cannot ground the knowledge we have of our own experience or, consequently, of the world. This, then, is a rejection of the traditional foundationalist picture, or what Sellars calls, "the Myth of the Given."

One of the forms taken by the Myth of the Given is the idea that there is, indeed must be, a structure of particular matter of such fact that (a) each fact can not only be noninferentially known to be the case, but presupposes no other knowledge either of particular matters of fact, or of general truths; and (b) such that the noninferential knowledge of facts belonging to this structure constitutes the ultimate court of appeal for all factual claims, particular and general, about the world. (Sellars, 1956, pp. 68-9)

c. Concepts and Experience

According to traditional foundationalism, the content of perceptual experience, the Given, is not conceptual in nature. It has been argued, however, that experience should not be seen in this traditional way. The phenomenon of "seeing as," suggests to some that experience should be interpreted as essentially conceptual in nature.

What is this a picture of?


You perhaps see a duck. I can, however, alter the character of your visual experience by changing the beliefs that you have about this picture. Think RABBIT looking upward. The picture now looks different to you even though you are seeing the same configuration of black marks on a white background. This picture is usually referred to as "the duck-rabbit." Originally, you saw the drawing as a duck; now you see it as a rabbit (or, as Wittgenstein would say, you notice different "aspects" of the picture). You have, then, distinct perceptual experiences dependent on the particular concepts "through which" you see that picture. Some take this to prove that perceptual experience is not pre- or non-conceptual but that it is essentially a conceptual engagement with the world. Such experience does not only consist in our having certain retinal images: "There is more to seeing than meets the eyeball," (Hanson, 1988, p. 294). It is, rather, the result of a necessary conceptual ordering of our perceptual engagement with the world. This is a theory of experience that is at odds with that of the traditional foundationalist.

The theory has Kantian roots. For Kant, one cannot experience the world without having a conceptual structure to provide the representational properties of such experience. In Kant's terms, the intuitions received by the sensibility cannot be isolated from the conceptualization carried out by the understanding. As he states, "Intuitions without concepts are blind, concepts without intuitions are empty" (Kant, 1781, A51 / B75). Intuitions, or what we might call bare perceptual experience--that which does not have a conceptual structure--cannot be seen as experience of a world, and therefore, such a conception of our perceptual engagement with the world cannot be seen as experiential at all; it is "blind". The second clause of Kant's aphorism claims that concepts that are not based on information received through the senses can have no empirical content. The Kantian claim, then, is that thinking about the world and experiencing it are interdependent. This is an attack on the distinction drawn in section 1a between simple seeing and conceptually structured forms of perception such as seeing that and seeing as. Kant claims the notion of simple seeing is incoherent since such a non-conceptual engagement with the world isn't experiential.

Not everyone accepts that the phenomenon of seeing as entails this picture of experience. Dretske (1969) argues that simple or non-epistemic seeing is independent of epistemic seeing; that is, it is independent of seeing that is conceptually structured. Non-epistemic seeing amounts to the ability to visually differentiate aspects of one's environment such as the bus stop and the waste bin, and one can do this without seeing these items as anything in particular (although, of course, one usually does). Further, "seeing as" presupposes simple seeing. One has to have some bare experience to provide the raw materials for our conceptually structured experience or thought. We may be able to see the picture above as a duck or as a rabbit, but we can only do this if we have a non-conceptual experience of a certain configuration of black marks on a white background. One's experience of the basic black and white lines in the figure is independent of any concepts one may have that may then allow one to see these lines in a certain more sophisticated way, that is, as a duck or as a rabbit. In reply, however, it could be claimed that even such a basic experience as this relies on the contingent fact that one has the concepts of, for example, BLACK and WHITE. Perhaps if one did not have these concepts, then one could not even see this basic figure.

We have, then, looked at two problems faced by the traditional foundationalist, both of which center on the alleged non-conceptual nature of perceptual experience. Two responses have been made by those who feel the force of these objections: some modify foundationalism in order to take account of some of the considerations above, and others reject it altogether. The first of these responses is the topic of the next section.

d. Modest Foundationalism

Some foundationalists agree that the Given is in some ways problematic, yet they still attempt to maintain a "modest" or "moderate" foundationalism. Audi (2003) and Plantinga (2000) promote this view. First, our perceptual beliefs concerning both the world and our own experience are not seen as infallible. You can believe that you see red or that you seem to see red, yet either belief could turn out to be unjustified. Second, non-conceptual perceptual experience does not play a justificatory role. Perceptual beliefs are simply self-justified; that is, it is reasonable to accept that they are true unless we have evidence to suggest that they may be untrustworthy. Such a view of perception remains foundationalist in nature because we still have basic beliefs, beliefs that are non-inferentially justified. Thus, the justification possessed by perceptual beliefs is defeasible. You may, for example, have good evidence that your cup of tea has been spiked with an hallucinogen, and, therefore, the justification for your perceptual belief that a pig has just flown past the window is defeated. More controversially, your belief that you seem to see red could be defeated by psychological evidence concerning your confused or inattentive state of mind. However, in the absence of any beliefs concerning such contravening evidence, your perceptual beliefs have prima facie justification.

Modest foundationalism avoids a dilemma that faces traditional foundationalism. It is certainly plausible that beliefs about your own perceptual experience are infallible and that you can't be wrong when you claim that the cup looks red. It is not clear, however, how such beliefs can ground your perceptual knowledge since they are about your own mental states and not the world. The fact that the cup looks red to you does of course relate to the cup, but primarily it is a fact about how that cup strikes your experience. Recoiling from such a picture, you could claim that your foundational beliefs concern the color of the cup and not merely your experience of the cup. However, it is not plausible that your beliefs about the color of the cup are infallible, and therefore, such beliefs cannot play a foundational role according to the traditional account. The modest foundationalist can avoid this dilemma. For a perceptual belief to be justified, it does not have to be infallible. You can, therefore, have beliefs about the properties of objects in the world playing the requisite foundational role rather than those that are simply about your own experiences.

4. Perception and Coherentism

Modest foundationalists attempt to keep some of the features of the traditional foundationalist picture while conceding that their foundations aren't infallible. There is, however, a distinct response to the problems associated with traditional foundationalism, and that is to reject its key feature, namely its reliance on foundational, non-inferential, basic beliefs. Coherentism presents an alternative. Coherentists such as Bonjour (1985) and Lehrer (1990) claim that beliefs can only be justified by other beliefs and that this is also true of our perceptual beliefs. Section 3.a described how Sellars argued for such a position in that, for him, perceptual beliefs must be supported by beliefs about the reliability of our experience. The next two sections explain the coherentist account of justifying perceptual claims.

a. The Basic Idea Behind Coherentism

For a coherentist, a particular belief is justified if one's set of beliefs is more coherent with this belief as a member, and, conversely, a belief is unjustified if the coherence of one's set of beliefs is increased by dropping that particular belief. The basic idea behind coherentism is that the better a belief system "hangs together," the more coherent it is. How, though, should we conceive of "hanging together" or "coherence"? First, one requires consistency. Our beliefs should not clash; they must not be logically inconsistent: we should not believe p and believe that not p. However, more than mere logical consistency is required. One could imagine a set of beliefs that consisted of the belief that 2+2=4, the belief that Cher is a great actress, and the belief that yellow clashes with pink. Although these beliefs are logically consistent, they do not form a particularly coherent belief set since they do not have any bearing on each other at all. For coherence, therefore, some kind of positive connection between one's beliefs is also required. Such a positive connection is that of inference. A maximally coherent belief set is one that is logically consistent and one within which the content of any particular belief can be inferred from the content of certain other beliefs that one holds. Conversely, the coherence of a set of beliefs is reduced if there are subgroups of beliefs that are inferentially isolated from the whole.

b. Bonjour and the Spontaneous Nature of Perceptual Beliefs

For a coherentist, perceptual beliefs are justified, as all beliefs are, if our acceptance of them leads to an increase in the overall coherence of our belief system. An account, though, is also required of how perceptual beliefs can be seen as correctly representing the external world, a world that is independent of our thinking. This is particularly pressing for the coherentist because the justification for our perceptual beliefs is provided by one's other beliefs and not by one's perceptual experience of one's environment.

To account for the representational ability of perceptual beliefs, Bonjour focuses upon a class of beliefs that he calls "cognitively spontaneous." These are beliefs we simply acquire without inference. Right now, on turning my head to the left, I spontaneously acquire the belief that the orange stapler is in front of the blue pen, and that my glass of water is half full. These perceptual beliefs are likely to be true when certain conditions obtain--that the light is good and that I am not too far away from what I am looking at (these Bonjour calls the "C-conditions"). My belief, then, that my glass is half full is only justified if I also have beliefs about the obtaining of C-conditions. However, for Bonjour's account to be persuasive, he needs to provide some justification for this claim that beliefs acquired in the C-conditions are likely to be true representations of the world. This he does. First, we do not arrive at them via inference; they are spontaneous. Second, the beliefs that we acquire in this way exhibit a very high measure of coherence and consistency with each other and with the rest of our belief system. The question arises, then, as to why this should be so, since it is not obvious why such spontaneous beliefs should continue to cohere so well. If, for example, these beliefs were randomly produced by our perceptual mechanisms, then our set of beliefs would very soon be disrupted. Bonjour's claim is that there is a good a priori explanation for the ongoing coherence and consistency of our set of beliefs, that is, that it is the result of our beliefs being caused by a coherent and consistent world. Thus, our perceptual beliefs correctly represent a world that is independent of our thinking. Non-conceptual perceptual experience does not play a justificatory role with respect to perception. This experience may cause us to acquire certain beliefs about our environment, but the justification for these perceptual beliefs is provided by the inferential relations that hold between these beliefs and the rest of our belief system.

There are important objections. Plantinga (1993) notes that in the Cartesian skeptical scenarios we also have a coherent set of beliefs, but in these cases they are caused not by a coherent and consistent world but by an evil demon or by a mad scientist who manipulates a brain that lies in a vat of nutrient fluid (see Descartes 1641 and Putnam 1981). Bonjour's claim, however, is that it is a priori more probable that our beliefs are not caused by these creatures. Plantinga finds such reasoning "monumentally dubious."

Even if such a hypothesis [that concerning the claim that our coherent belief system corresponds to a coherent world] and these skeptical explanations do have an a priori's surely anyone's guess what that probability might be. Assuming there is such a thing as a priori probability, what would be the a priori probability of our having been created by a good God who...would not deceive us? What would be the a priori probability of our having been created by an evil demon who delights in deception? And which, if either, would have the greater a priori probability? could we possibly tell? (Plantinga, 1993, p. 109)

5. Externalism

The varieties of foundationalism and coherentism examined so far share a certain approach to questions concerning epistemic justification. They ask whether the evidence available to you is sufficient to justify the beliefs that you hold. Questions of justification are approached from the first person perspective. Foundationalists claim that you have justified perceptual beliefs because of the fact that these beliefs are grounded in your perceptual experience, experience that is, of course, accessible to you; it is something of which you are aware, something that you can reflect upon. Coherentists find justification in the inferential relations that hold between your perceptual and non-perceptual beliefs, relations that are, again, something to which you have cognitive access. Epistemic practices can, however, also be assessed from the third person perspective. It can be asked whether a person's methods do, in fact, lead him or her to have true beliefs about the world, whether or not such reliability is something of which they are aware. Externalists claim that it is this perspective with which epistemology should be concerned. A key notion for externalists is that of reliability. A belief is justified if it is acquired using a method that is reliable, with reliability being cashed out in terms of the probability that one's thinking latches onto the truth.

The justificatory status of a belief is a function of the reliability of the processes that cause it, where (as a first approximation) reliability consists in the tendency of a process to produce beliefs that are true rather than false. (Goldman, 1979, p. 10)

One need not be able to tell by reflection alone whether or not one's thinking is reliable in the required sense; a thinker does not have to be aware of what it is that justifies his or her beliefs.

According to a reliabilist, then, a perceptual belief is justified if it is the product of reliable perceptual processes. One strategy that reliabilists have adopted is to ground their account of reliability in terms of the causal connections that thinkers have to the world. Roughly, for one to have a justified perceptual belief that p, the fact that p should cause my belief that p. I am justified in believing that Frasier is on television because its presence on the screen causes my belief. Such accounts are developed by Goldman (1979 / 1986) and Dretske (1981). It is important to note the difference between this kind of account and that of Armstrong (section 2a). Armstrong eschews all talk of justification and provides a wholly causal account of perceptual knowledge. Many externalists, however, give an account of justification in causal terms.

It was assumed throughout this article, except during the discussion of scepticism, that we do have perceptual knowledge of the world, and the article explored the multifarious epistemic and causal relations that there are between the various modes of perception and perceptual knowledge. Justification is the key issue, and there are four basic stances. One stance is to agree with Armstrong and deny that perceptual experience plays any justificatory role. Foundationalists see perceptual experience as the justificatory basis for perceptual knowledge, and it is such experience that ultimately provides justification for all our knowledge of the world. Problems with the traditional form of this position urged us to explore a more modest form of foundationalism. Others reject foundationalism altogether. Coherentists claim that the justification for our perceptual beliefs is a function of how well those beliefs "hang together" with the rest of our belief system. They too reject the justificatory role of perceptual experience. Some externalists claim that justification is a matter of reliability and that so long as our perceptual beliefs are produced by mechanisms that reliably give us true beliefs, then those beliefs are justified. Therefore, perception is of prime epistemological importance, and it remains the focus of lively philosophical debate.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. M. 'The Thermometer Theory of Knowledge' in S. Bernecker & F. Dretske, eds. Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology, Oxford University Press, Oxford, pp. 72-85, 2000. Originally published in Armstrong, 1973, pp. 162-75, 178-83.
  • Armstrong, D. M. Belief, Truth and Knowledge, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1973.
  • Armstrong, D. M. Perception and the Physical World, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London, 1961.
    • Included in the above is Armstrong's causal account of perception.
  • Audi, R. "Contemporary Modest Foundationalism," in Pojman, L. ed. The Theory of Knowledge: Classical and Contemporary Readings, Wadsworth, Belmont, CA. 3rd edition, 2003.
    • A useful paper in which it is argued that modest foundationalism has advantages over traditional foundationalism.
  • Bonjour, L. The Structure of Empirical Knowledge, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass. 1985.
    • A well-developed coherentist theory of justification which includes an account of the role of perception within such a theory. (One should note, however, that Bonjour has recently abandoned coherentism in favour of a version of foundationalism.)
  • Chisholm, R. M. Theory of Knowledge, 3rd edition, Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey, 1989.
    • A wide ranging study of various epistemological issues including his version of traditional foundationalism.
  • Descartes, R. "First Meditation," in Meditations on First Philosophy, 1641. Reprinted in The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, eds. J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff & D. Murdoch, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1983.
    • One of the most influential passages of epistemological writing in the history of Western philosophy in which various skeptical possibilities are raised that suggest that our perceptual beliefs may not be justified.
  • Dretske, F. Seeing and Knowing, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London, 1969.
    • Dretske defends the claim that seeing can be seen as non-conceptual (or non-epistemic).
  • Dretske, F. Knowledge and the Flow of Information, MIT Press, Cambridge, Mass. 1981.
    • Here he presents his sophisticated version of reliabilism.
  • Goldman, A. I. "What is Justified Belief?," in G. Pappas, ed. Justification and Knowledge: New Studies in Epistemology, Reidel, pp. 1-23, 1979.
  • Goldman, A.I. Epistemology and Cognition, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass. 1986.
    • In the above, Goldman forwards his reliabilist account of justification.
  • Grice, H. P. "The Causal Theory of Perception," in Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 35, pp. 121-52, 1961.
    • A precursor to the various contemporary causal theories of perception, presented in the context of a sense datum theory of perception.
  • Hanson, N. R. "From Patterns of Discovery," in Perception, R. Schwartz, ed. pp. 292- 305, 1988.
    • Hansen argues that the nature of our perceptual experience depends on the concepts we possess.
  • Kant, I. The Critique of Pure Reason, trans. N. Kemp Smith, 1929 edition, The Macmillan Press, Ltd. Basingstoke, Hampshire, 1781.
    • One of the greatest and most influential works of modern philosophy. Of relevance to this article are Kant's thoughts concerning the relation between our conceptual framework and the nature of our perceptual experience.
  • Lehrer, K. Theory of Knowledge, Westview Press, Boulder, Colorado, 1990.
    • Lehrer provides a critique of foundationalism and his own developed version of coherentism.
  • Lewis, C. I. An Analysis of Knowledge and Evaluation, La Salle, Illinois, 1946.
    • Amongst various other important epistemological issues, one can find Lewis's account of traditional foundationalism.
  • McDowell, J. Mind and World, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass. 1994.
    • In this transcription of his Locke lectures, McDowell argues that perceptual experience is essentially conceptual in nature.
  • Plantinga, A. Warrant: The Current Debate, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 1993.
    • An excellent epistemology textbook which includes an in-depth critique of Bonjour's coherentism.
  • Plantinga, A. Warranted Christian Belief, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 2000.
    • In the context of a sophisticated discussion of the philosophy of religion, Plantinga develops a version of modest foundationalism which he calls "reformed epistemology".
  • Putnam, H. Reason, Truth and History, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1981.
    • In chapter 1, Putnam presents his contemporary brain in a vat version of the Cartesian skeptical scenario.
  • Rorty, R. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, Princetown University Press, Princetown, 1979.
    • A historically informed and extended attack on traditional foundationalism.
  • Schwartz, R. Perception, Blackwell, Oxford, 1988.
    • A good collection of articles focused on the epistemology of perception.
  • Sellars, W. Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind. Originally published in H. Feigl and M. Scrivens, eds. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. 1, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, pp. 253-329, 1956. Page numbers here refer to 1997 reprint, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass.
    • This includes Sellars' influential attack on the Given.

Author Information

Daniel O'Brien
The University of Birmingham
U. S. A.

Religious Epistemology

Belief in God, or some form of transcendent Real, has been assumed in virtually every culture throughout human history. The issue of the reasonableness or rationality of belief in God or particular beliefs about God typically arises when a religion is confronted with religious competitors or the rise of atheism or agnosticism. In the West, belief in God was assumed in the dominant Jewish, Christian and Islamic religions. God, in this tradition, is the omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good and all-loving Creator of the universe (such a doctrine is sometimes called ‘bare theism’). This article considers the following epistemological issues: reasonableness of belief in the Judeo-Christian-Muslim God ("God," for short), the nature of reason, the claim that belief in God is not rational, defenses that it is rational, and approaches that recommend groundless belief in God or philosophical fideism.

Is belief in God rational? The evidentialist objector says “No” due to the lack of evidence. Theists who say “Yes” fall into two main categories: those who claim that there is sufficient evidence and those who claim that evidence is not necessary. Theistic evidentialists contend that there is enough evidence to ground rational belief in God, while Reformed epistemologists contend that evidence is not necessary to ground rational belief in God (but that belief in God is grounded in various characteristic religious experiences). Philosophical fideists deny that belief in God belongs in the realm of the rational. And, of course, all of these theistic claims are widely and enthusiastically disputed by philosophical non-theists.

Table of Contents

  1. Reason/Rationality
  2. The Evidentialist Objection to Belief in God
  3. The Reasonableness of Belief in God
    1. Theistic Evidentialism
    2. Sociological Digression
    3. Moral Analogy
    4. Reformed Epistemology
    5. Religious Experience
    6. Internalism/Externalism
    7. The Rational Stance
    8. Objections to Reformed Epistemology
  4. Groundless Believing
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Reason/Rationality

Reason is a fallible human tool for discovering truth or grasping reality. Although reason aims at the truth, it may fall short. In addition, rationality is more a matter of how one believes than what one believes. For example, one might irrationally believe something that is true: suppose one believed that the center of the earth is molten metal because one believes that he or she travels there every night (while it’s cool). And one might rationally believe what is false: it was rational for most people twenty centuries ago to believe that the earth is flat. And finally, rationality is person and situation specific: what is rational for one person at a particular socio-historical time and place might not be rational for another person at a different time and place; or, for that matter, what is rational for a person in the same time and place may be irrational for another person in the same time and place. This has relevance for a discussion of belief in God because “the rationality of religious belief” is typically discussed abstractly, independent of any particular believer and often believed to be settled once and for all either positively or negatively (say, by Aquinas or Hume respectively). The proper question should be, “Is belief in God rational for this person in that time and place?”

Rationality is a normative property possessed by a belief or a believer (although I’ve given reasons in the previous paragraph to suggest that rationality applies more properly to believers than to beliefs). Just precisely what this normative property is is a matter of great dispute. Some believe that we have intellectual duties (for example, to acquire true beliefs and avoid false beliefs, or to believe only on the basis of evidence or argument). Some deny that we have intellectual duties because, by and large, beliefs are not something we freely choose (e.g., look outside at a tree, consider the tree and try to choose not to believe that there’s a tree there; or, close your eyes and if you believe in God, decide not to believe or vice versa and now decide to believe in God again). Since we only have duties when we are free to fulfill or to not fulfill them (“Ought implies can”), we cannot have intellectual duties if we aren’t free to directly choose our beliefs. So, the normative property espoused by such thinkers might be intellectual permissibility rather than intellectual duty.

Since the time of the Enlightenment, reason has assumed a huge role for (valid or strong) inference: rationality is often a matter of assembling available (often empirical, typically propositional) evidence and assessing its deductive or inductive support for other beliefs; although some beliefs may and must be accepted without inference, the vast majority of beliefs or, more precisely, the vast majority of philosophical, scientific, ethical, theological and even common-sensical beliefs rationally require the support of evidence or argument. This view of reason is often taken ahistorically: rationality is simply a matter of timeless and non-person indexed propositional evidence and its logical bearing on the conclusion. If it can be shown that an argument is invalid or weak, belief in its conclusion would be irrational for every person in every time and place. This violates the viable intuition that rationality is person- and situation- specific. Although one argument for belief in God might be invalid, there might be other arguments that support belief in God. Or, supposing all of the propositional evidence for God’s existence is deficient, a person may have religious experience as the grounds of her belief in God.

Following Thomas Reid, we shall argue that ‘rationality’ in many of the aforementioned important cases need not, indeed cannot, require (valid or strong) inference. Our rational cognitive faculties include a wide variety of belief-producing mechanisms, few of which could or should pass the test of inference. We will let this view, and its significance for belief in God, emerge as the discussion proceeds.

2. The Evidentialist Objection to Belief in God

Belief in God is considered irrational for two primary reasons: lack of evidence and evidence to the contrary (usually the problem of evil, which won’t be discussed in this essay). Note that both of these positions reject the rationality of belief in God on the basis of an inference. Bertrand Russell was once asked, if he were to come before God, what he would say to God. Russell replied, “Not enough evidence God, not enough evidence.” Following Alvin Plantinga, we will call the claim that belief in God lacks evidence and is thus irrational the evidentialist objection to belief in God.

The roots of evidentialism may be found in the Enlightenment demand that all beliefs be subjected to the searching criticism of reason; if a belief cannot survive the scrutiny of reason, it is irrational. Kant’s charge is clear: “Dare to use your own reason.” Given increasing awareness of religious options, Hobbes would ask: “If one prophet deceive another, what certainty is there of knowing the will of God, by any other way than that of reason?” Although the Enlightenment elevation of Reason would come to be associated with a corresponding rejection of rational religious belief, many of the great Enlightenment thinkers were themselves theists (including, for example, Kant and Hobbes).

The evidentialist objection may be formalized as follows:

(1) Belief in God is rational only if there is sufficient evidence for the existence of God.

(2) There is not sufficient evidence for the existence of God.

(3) Therefore, belief in God is irrational.

The evidentialist objection is not offered as a disproof of the existence of God—that is, the conclusion is not "God does not exist." Rather the conclusion is, even if God were to exist, it would not be reasonable to believe in God. According to the evidentialist objection, rational belief in God hinges on the success of theistic arguments. Prominent evidentialist objectors include David Hume, W. K. Clifford, J. L. Mackie, Bertrand Russell and Michael Scriven. This view is probably held by a large majority of contemporary Western philosophers. Ironically, in most areas of philosophy and life, most philosophers are not (indeed could not be) evidentialists. We shall treat this claim shortly.

The claim that there is not sufficient evidence for belief in God is usually based on a negative assessment of the success of theistic proofs or arguments. Following Hume and Kant, the standard arguments for the existence of God—cosmological, teleological and ontological—are judged to be defective in one respect or another.

The claim that rational belief in God requires the support of evidence or argument is usually rooted in a view of the structure of knowledge that has come to be known as ‘classical foundationalism.’ Classical foundationalists take a pyramid or a house as metaphors for their conceptions of knowledge or rationality. A secure house or pyramid must have secure foundations sufficient to carry the weight of each floor of the house and the roof. A solid, enduring house has a secure foundation with each of the subsequent floors properly attached to that foundation. Ultimately, the foundation carries the weight of the house. In a classical foundationalist conception of knowledge, the foundational beliefs must likewise be secure, enduring and adequate to bear “the weight” of all of the non-foundational or higher-level beliefs. These foundational beliefs are characterized in such a manner to ensure that knowledge is built on a foundation of certitudes (following Descartes). The candidates for these foundational certitudes vary from thinker to thinker but, broadly speaking, reduce to three: if a belief is self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible, it is a proper candidate for inclusion among the foundations of rational belief.

What sorts of beliefs are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible? A self-evident belief is one that, upon understanding it, you see it to be true. While this definition is probably not self-evident, let’s proceed to understand it by way of example. Read the following fairly quickly:

(4) When equals are added to equals you get equals.

Do you think (4) is true? False? Not sure? Let me explain it. When equals (2 and 1+1) are added to equals (2 and 1+1) you get equals (4). Or, to make this clear 2 + 2 = 1 + 1 + 1 + 1. Now that you understand (4), you see it to be true. I didn’t argue for (4), I simply helped you to understand it, and upon understanding it, you saw it to be true. That is, (4) is self-evident. Typical self-evident beliefs include the laws of logic and arithmetic and some metaphysical principles like “An object can’t be red all over and blue all over at the same time.” A proposition is evident to the senses in case it is properly acquired by the use of one’s five senses. These sorts of propositions include “The grass is green,” “The sky is blue,” “Honey tastes sweet,” and “I hear a mourning dove.” Some epistemologists exclude propositions that are evident to the senses from the foundations of knowledge because of their lack of certainty [the sky may be colorless as a piece of glass but simply refracts blue light waves; we may be sampling artificial (and not real) honey; or someone may be blowing a bird whistle; etc.]. In order to ensure certainty, some have shifted to incorrigibility as the criterion of foundational beliefs. Incorrigible beliefs are first-person psychological states (seeming or appearance beliefs) about which I cannot be wrong. For example, I might be mistaken about the color of the grass or sky but I cannot be mistaken about the following: “The grass seems green to me” or “The sky appears to me to be blue.” I might be mistaken about the color of grass, and so such a belief is not certain for me, but I can’t be wrong about what the color of grass seems to be to me.

Now let us return to belief in God. Why do evidentialists hold (1), the claim that rational belief in God requires the support of evidence or argument? This is typically because they subscribe to classical foundationalism. A belief can be held without argument or evidence only if it is self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. Belief in God is not self-evident—it is not such that upon understanding the notion of God, you see that God exists. For example, Bertrand Russell understands the proposition “God exists” but does not see it to be true. So, belief in God is not a good candidate for self-evidence. Belief in God is not evident to the senses because God, by definition, transcends the sensory world. God cannot be seen, heard, touched, tasted or smelled. When people make claims such as “God spoke to me” or “I touched God,” they are using “spoke” and “touched” in a metaphorical sense, not a literal sense; literally, God is beyond the senses. So God’s existence is not evident to the senses. And finally, a person might be wrong about God’s existence and so belief in God cannot be incorrigible. Of course, “it seems to me that God exists” could be incorrigible but God’s seeming existence is a long way from God’s existence!

So, belief in God is neither self-evident, evident to the senses, nor incorrigible. Therefore, belief in God, according to classical foundationalism, cannot properly be included among the foundations of one’s rational beliefs. And, if it is not part of the foundations, it must be adequately supported by the foundational beliefs—that is, belief in God must be held on the basis of other beliefs and so must be argued to, not from. According to classical foundationalism, belief in God is not rational unless it is supported by evidence or argument. Classical foundationalism, as assumed in the Enlightenment, elevated theistic arguments to a status never held before in the history of Western thought. Although previous thinkers would develop theistic arguments, they seldom assumed that they were necessary for rational belief in God. After the period of the Enlightenment, thinkers in the grips of classical foundationalism would now hold belief in God up to the demand of rigorous proof.

3. The Reasonableness of Belief in God

There are two main strategies theists employ when responding to the evidentialist objection to belief in God. The first strategy is to argue against the second premise, the claim that there is insufficient evidence for the existence of God. The second strategy is to argue against the first premise, the claim that belief in God is rational only if it is supported by sufficient evidence.

a. Theistic Evidentialism

Consider first the claim that there is not sufficient evidence for the existence of God. This view has been historically rejected by Aristotle, Augustine, Anselm, Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, John Locke, William Paley and C. S. Peirce, to name but a few. But suppose we all agreed that the arguments offered by Aristotle and others for the existence of God were badly flawed. (“We know better now.”) Does that imply that earlier theists were irrational? Does the evidence have to support, in some timeless way—irrespective of any particular person—belief in God? Aristotle, Augustine, Aquinas, et al., were brilliant people doing the best they could with the most sophisticated belief-set available to them and judged, on the basis of their best lights, that the evidence supported belief in God. Are they nonetheless irrational? For example, suppose that, ignorant of the principle of inertia, Aquinas believed that God must be actively involved in the continual motion of the planets. That is, suppose that, using the best physics of his day, Aquinas believed in the scientific necessity of belief in God. According to his best lights, Aquinas thought that the evidence clearly supported belief in God. Would Aquinas be irrational? Evidentialist objectors might concede that Aquinas was not irrational, in spite of his bad arguments and, therefore, might not view rationality as being timeless. But, they would argue, it is no longer reasonable for anyone to believe in God because now we all see or should see that the evidence is clearly insufficient to support the conclusion that God exists. (This ‘we’ tends toward the princely philosophical.)

Some theists reject this conclusion, judging that there is adequate evidence to support God’s existence. Rejecting the idea that theistic arguments died along with Kant and Hume, these thinkers offer new evidence or refashion the old evidence for the existence of God. William Lane Craig (Craig and Smith 1993), for example, has developed a new version of the old Islamic Kalaam cosmological argument for the existence of God. This argument attempts to demonstrate the impossibility that time could have proceeded infinitely into the past so the universe must have had a beginning in time. In addition, both physicists and philosophers have argued that the apparent fine-tuning of the cosmological constants to permit human life is best explained by God’s intelligent superintendence. And some argue that irreducibly complex biological phenomena such as cells or kidneys could not have arisen by chance. Robert Merrihew Adams (1987) has revived moral arguments for the existence of God. Alvin Plantinga (1993b) has argued that naturalism and evolution are self-refuting. William Alston (1991) has defended religious experience as a source of justified belief in the existence of God. In addition, theistic arguments have been developed that are based on the existence of flavors, colors and beauty. And some thinkers, such as Richard Swinburne (1979, 1984), contend that the cumulative forces of these various kinds of evidence mutually reinforce the likelihood of God’s existence. Thus, there is an ample lot defending the claim that belief in God is rational based on the evidence (and an equal and opposite force opposing them). So the project of securing belief in God on the basis of evidence or argument is ongoing.

Many theists, then, concur with the evidentialist demand for evidence and seek to meet that demand by offering arguments that support the existence of God. Of course, these arguments have been widely criticized by atheistic evidentialists. But for better or for worse, many theistic philosophers have hitched the rationality of belief in God to the wagon of evidence.

Now suppose, as is the case, that the majority of philosophers believes that these attempts to prove God’s existence are feeble failures. Would that perforce make religious believers irrational? If one, by the best of one’s lights, judges that God exists given the carefully considered evidence, is one nonetheless irrational if the majority of the philosophical community happen to disagree? These questions suggest that judgments of rationality and irrationality are difficult to make. And, it suggests that rationality and irrationality may be more complicated than classical foundationalism assumes.

b. Sociological Digression

Very few philosophical positions (and this is an understatement) enjoy the kind of evidential support that classical foundationalism demands of belief in God; yet most of these are treated as rational. No philosophical position—belief in other minds, belief in the external world, the correspondence theory of truth or Quine’s indeterminacy of translation thesis—is properly based on beliefs that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. Indeed, we may question whether there is a single philosophical position that has been so amply justified (or could be). Why is belief in God held to a higher evidential standard than other philosophical beliefs? Some suggest that this demand is simply arbitrary at best or intellectually imperialist at worst.

c. Moral Analogy

Consider your moral beliefs. None of these beliefs will be self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. Now suppose you hold a moral belief that is not the philosophical fashion these days. Would you be irrational if the majority of contemporary philosophers disagreed with you? Perhaps you’d be irrational if moral beliefs contrary to yours could be established on the basis of widely known arguments from premises that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. But there may be no such arguments in the history of moral theory. Moral beliefs are not well-justified on the basis of argument or evidence in the classical foundationalist sense (or probably in any sense of “well-justified”). So, the fact that the majority of contemporary philosophers reject your moral beliefs (or belief in God for that matter) may have little or no bearing on the rationality of your beliefs. The sociological digression and moral analogy suggest that the philosophical emphasis on argument, certainty, and consensus for rationality might be misguided.

d. Reformed Epistemology

Let us now turn to those who reject the first premise of the evidentialist objection to belief in God, the claim that rational belief in God requires the support of evidence or argument. Recent thinkers such as Alvin Plantinga, Nicholas Wolterstorff and William Alston, in their so called Reformed Epistemology, have argued that belief in God does not require the support of evidence or argument in order for it to be rational (cf. Plantinga and Wolterstorff 1983). In so doing, they reject the evidentialist objector’s assumptions about rationality.

Reformed epistemologists argue that the first problem with the evidentialist objection is that the universal demand for evidence simply cannot be met in a large number of cases with the cognitive equipment that we have. No one has ever been able to offer proofs for the existence of other persons, inductive beliefs (e.g., that the sun will rise in the future), or the reality of the past (perhaps, as Bertrand Russell cloyingly puzzled, we were created five minutes ago with our memories intact) that satisfy classical foundationalist requirements for proof. So, according to classical foundationalism, belief in the past and inductive beliefs about the future are irrational. This list could be extended indefinitely.

There is also a limit to the things that human beings can prove. If we were required to prove everything, there would be an infinite regress of provings. There must be some truths that we can just accept and reason from. Thus, we can’t help but trust our cognitive faculties. Moreover, it seems that we will reach the limit of proof very quickly if, as classical foundationalism insists, the basis for inference includes only beliefs that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. For these reasons, reformed epistemologists doubt that classical foundationalists are correct in claiming that the proper starting point of reason is self-evidence, evidence to the senses, and incorrigibility.

A second criticism of classical foundationalism, first offered by Plantinga, is that it is self-referentially inconsistent. That is, classical foundationalism must be rejected by its own account. Recall classical foundationalism (CF):

A proposition p is rational if and only if p is self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible or if p can be inferred from a set of propositions that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible.

Consider CF itself. Is it rational, given its own conditions, to accept classical foundationalism? Classical foundationalism is not self-evident: upon understanding it many people believe it false. If one can understand a proposition and reject it, that proposition cannot be self-evident. CF is also not a sensory proposition—one doesn’t see, taste, smell, touch or hear it. So, classical foundationalism is not evident to the senses. And even if one should accept classical foundationalism, one might be wrong; so classical foundationalism is not incorrigible. Since classical foundationalism is neither self-evident, evident to the senses nor incorrigible, it can only be rationally maintained if it can be inferred from propositions that (ultimately) are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible. Is that possible? Consider a representative set of evidential propositions, E, that are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible:

Evidence (E):

    • When equals are added to equals you get equals.
    • 2 + 2 = 4
    • Grass is green.
    • The sky is blue.
    • Grass seems green to me.
    • The sky appears to me to be blue.


Limiting yourself to propositions that are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible, you can expand this list as exhaustively as you like. We have enough in E to make our case. Given E as evidence, can CF be inferred? Is E adequate evidence for CF? It’s hard to imagine how it could be. Indeed all of the propositions in E are irrelevant to the truth of CF. E simply cannot logically support CF. So, CF is not self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible, nor can CF be inferred from a set of propositions that are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible. So, CF, by its own account, is irrational. If CF were true, it would be irrational to accept it. Better simply to reject it!

Thomas Reid (1710-1796), whom Plantinga and Wolterstorff follow, was an early critic of classical foundationalism. Reid argued that we have been outfitted with a host of cognitive faculties that produce beliefs that we can reason from (the foundations of believings). Plantinga calls these basic beliefs. The kinds of beliefs that we do and must reason to is a small subset of the kinds of beliefs that we do and must reason from. The latter must be accepted without the aid of proof. In most cases we must rely on our intellectual equipment to produce beliefs in the appropriate circumstances, without evidence or argument. For example, we simply find ourselves believing in other persons. A person is a center of self-conscious thoughts and feelings and first-person experience. While we can see a human face or a body, we can’t see another’s thoughts or feelings. Consider a person, Emily, whose leg is poked with a needle. We can see Emily recoil and her face screw up, and we can hear her yelp. So we can see Emily’s pain-behavior, but we cannot see her pain. The experience of pain is just the sort of inner experience that is typical of persons. For all we can know from Emily’s pain-behavior, she might be a cleverly constructed automaton (like Data of Star Trek fame or an exact human replica all the way down to the neurons). Or, for all we know, Emily might be a person just like us with the characteristic interior life and experience of persons. The point is, you can’t tell, just from Emily’s pain behavior, if she has any inner experience of pain. So you can’t tell by the things to which you have evidential access if Emily is a person. No one has ever been able to develop a successful argument to prove that there are other persons. So if classical foundationalism were true, it would not be reasonable to believe in the existence of other persons. But surely there are other persons whose existence it is reasonable to accept. So much the worse for classical foundationalism, Reidians say. Similar problems arise for classical foundationalism concerning beliefs in the past, the future, and the external world. No justification-conferring inference is or could be involved. Yet, the Reidian claims, we are perfectly within our epistemic rights in holding these basic beliefs. Thus, we should conclude that these beliefs are properly basic (that is, non-inferential but justified beliefs) and should reject classical foundationalism’s claim to the contrary.

Granting that a great many of our important beliefs are non-inferential, could one reasonably find oneself believing in God without evidence or argument? ‘Evidence’ is to be understood here as most evidentialists understand it, namely as the kind of propositional evidence one might find in a theistic argument and not the kind of experiential evidence typically thought to ground religious belief. Could belief in God be properly basic?

There are at least two reasons to believe that it might be rational for a person to accept belief in God without the support of an argument. The first is a parity argument. We must, by our nature, accept the deliverances of our cognitive faculties, including those that produce beliefs in the external world, other persons, that the future will be like the past, the reality of the past, and what other people tell us—just to name a few. For the sake of parity, we should trust the deliverances of the faculty that produces in us belief in the divine (what Plantinga (2000), following John Calvin, calls the sensus divinitatus, the sense of the divine). Of course, some philosophers deny that we have a sensus divinitatus and so reject the parity argument. The second reason is that belief in God is more like belief in a person than belief in a scientific hypothesis. Human relations demand trust, commitment, and faith. If belief in God is more like belief in other persons than belief in atoms, then the trust that is appropriate to persons will be appropriate to God. William James offers a similar argument in “The Will to Believe.”

Reformed epistemologists hold that one can reasonably believe in God—immediately and basically—without the support of an argument. One’s properly functioning cognitive faculties can produce belief in God in the appropriate circumstances with or without argument or evidence.

e. Religious Experience

Although Plantinga contends that belief in God does not require the support of propositional evidence or argument (like a theistic proof) in order to be rational, he does contend that belief in God is not groundless. According to Plantinga, belief in God is grounded in characteristic religious experiences such as beholding the divine majesty on the top of a mountain or the divine creativity when noticing the articulate beauty of the flower. Other sorts of alleged religious experiences involve a sense of guilt (and forgiveness), despair, the inner testimony of the Holy Spirit, or direct contact with the divine (mysticism). The experience of many believers is so vivid that they describe it with sensory metaphors: they claim to see, hear or be touched by God.

It is important to note that people who believe on the basis of religious experience do not typically construe their belief in God as based on an argument (any more than belief in other persons is based on an argument). They believe they have seen or heard God directly and find themselves overwhelmed by belief in God. Religious experience is typically taken as self-authenticating. In good Reidian fashion, one might simply take it that one has a cognitive faculty that can be trusted when it produces belief in God when induced by the appropriate experiences; that is, one is permitted to trust one’s initial alleged religious experience as veridical, just as one must trust that others of one’s cognitive faculties are veridical. (It should be noted that Reid himself does not make this claim. He believes that God’s existence can and should be supported by argument.) Richard Swinburne alleges that it is also reasonable to trust what others tell us unless and until we have good reason to believe otherwise. So, it would be reasonable for someone who did not have a religious experience to trust the veridicality of someone who did claim to have a religious experience. That is, it would be reasonable for everyone, not just the subject of the alleged religious experience, to believe in God on the basis of that alleged religious experience.

Some philosophers reject religious experience as a proper ground for religious belief. While not denying that some people have had powerful, so-called mystical experiences, they deny that one can reliably infer from that experience that the source or cause of that experience was God. Even the most enthusiastic mystics contend that some mystical experiences are illusory. So, how does one sort out the veridical from the illusory without begging the question? And if other evidence must be brought in to assess the validity of religious experience, is not then religious belief based more on that evidence than on the immediate experience? William Alston (1991) responds to these sorts of challenges by noting that perceptual experience, which is seldom questioned, is afflicted with precisely the same problems. Yet we do not take perceptual beliefs to be suspect. Alston argues that if religious experiences and the beliefs they produce relevantly resemble perceptual experiences and the beliefs they produce, then we should not hold beliefs based upon religious experience to be suspect either.

f. Internalism/Externalism

Some of the most important issues concerning the rationality of religious belief are framed in terms of the distinction between internalism and externalism in epistemology. Philosophers who are internalists with respect to rationality argue that we can tell, from the inside so to speak, if our beliefs are rationally justified. The language used by the classical foundationalist to describe basic beliefs is thoroughly internalist. ‘Self-evident’ and ‘evident to the senses’ are suggestive of beliefs that have a certain inner, compelling and unquestionable luminosity; one can simply inspect one’s beliefs and “see” if they are evident in the appropriate respects. And since deductive inference transfers rational justification from lower levels to higher levels, by carefully checking the inferential relations among one’s beliefs, one can see this luminosity passing from basic to non-basic beliefs. So internalists believe that rationality is something that can be discerned by the mental inspection of one’s own beliefs, items to which one has direct cognitive access.

Plantinga, on the other hand, argues that modern foundationalism has misunderstood the nature of rational justification. Plantinga calls the special property that turns true belief into knowledge “warrant.” According to Plantinga, a belief has warrant for one if and only if that belief is produced by one’s properly functioning cognitive faculties in circumstances to which those faculties are designed to apply; in addition, those faculties must be designed for the purpose of producing true beliefs. So, for instance, my belief that ‘there is a computer screen in front of me’ is warranted only if it is produced by my properly functioning perceptual faculties (and not by weariness or dreaming), if no one is tricking me, say, by having removed my computer and replaced it with an exact painting of my computer (thereby messing up my cognitive environment), and if my perceptual faculties have been designed (by God) for the purpose of producing true beliefs. Only if all of these conditions are satisfied is my belief that there is a computer screen in front of me warranted.

Note the portions of Plantinga’s definition which are not within one’s internal or direct purview: whether or not one’s faculties are functioning properly, whether or not one’s faculties are designed by God, whether or not one’s faculties are designed for the production of true beliefs, whether or not one is using one’s faculties in the environment intended for their use (one might be seeing a mirage and taking it for real). According to Plantinga’s externalism we cannot acquire warrant simply by attending to our beliefs. Warranted belief (knowledge) depends on circumstances external to the believing agent and so is not entirely up to us. Warrant depends crucially upon whether or not conditions that are not under our direct rational purview or conscious control are satisfied. If externalism is correct, then classical foundationalism has completely misunderstood the nature of epistemic warrant.

g. The Rational Stance

Because of the possibility of error, those who accept belief in God as a basic belief should nonetheless be concerned with evidence for and against belief in God. Following Reid, Reformed epistemologists contend that belief begins with trust (not suspicion, as the evidentialist apparently claims). Beliefs are, in their terms, innocent until proven guilty rather than guilty until proven innocent. In order to grasp reality, we must use and trust our cognitive faculties or capacities. But we also know that we get things wrong. The deliverances of our cognitive faculties are not infallible. Reid, Plantinga and Wolterstorff are keenly aware of human fallibility and recognize the need for a deliberative (reasoning) faculty that helps us adjudicate apparent conflicts among beliefs delivered innocently by our cognitive faculties. Reid’s general approach to rational belief is this: trust the beliefs produced by your cognitive faculties in the appropriate circumstances, unless you have good reason to reject them.

Let’s press the problem of error. As shown by widespread disagreement, our cognitive faculties seem less reliable in matters of fundamental human concern such as the nature of morality, the nature of persons, social and political thought, and belief in God. Given that rationality is truth-aimed, Reformed epistemologists should be willing to do two things to make the attainment of that goal more likely. First, they ought to seek, as best they can, supporting evidence for immediately produced beliefs of fundamental human concern. Because evidence is truth-conducive, it can lend credence to a basic belief. It doesn’t follow that basic beliefs about morality, God, etc. are irrational until such evidence is adduced; but perhaps one’s epistemic status on these matters can be improved by obtaining confirming evidence. This would make Reformed epistemology a paradigmatic example of the Augustinian view of faith and reason: fides quaerens intellectum (faith seeking understanding). Second, they ought to be open to contrary evidence to root out false beliefs. Given the likelihood that they could be wrong about these matters, they ought not close themselves off to the possibility of epistemic correction. If Reformed epistemologists are sincere truth-seekers, they should take the following stance:

The Rational Stance: Trust the deliverances of reason, seek supporting evidence, and be open to contrary evidence.

According to Reformed epistemology, evidence may not be required for belief in God to be rational. But, given the problem of error, it should nonetheless continue to play an important role in the life of the believer. Fides quaerens intellectum.

h. Objections to Reformed Epistemology

Reformed epistemology has been rejected for three primary reasons. First, some philosophers deny that we have a sensus divinitatus and so reject the parity argument. Second, some philosophers argue that Reformed epistemology is too latitudinarian, permitting the rational acceptability of virtually any belief. Gary Gutting calls this ‘the Great Pumpkin Objection’ because Charlie Brown could have written a defense of the sensus pumpkinus that is parallel to Plantinga’s defense of the sensus divinitatus. Finally, Reformed epistemology has been rejected because it has been perceived to be a form of fideism. Fideism is the view that belief in God should be held in the absence of or even in opposition to reason. According to this traditional definition of fideism, Reformed epistemology does not count as a form of fideism because it goes to great lengths to show that belief in God is rational. However, if one defines fideism as the view that belief in God may be rightly held in the absence of evidence or argument, then Reformed epistemology will be a kind of fideism.

4. Groundless Believing

With their emphasis on reason, very few philosophers aspire to fideism. Nonetheless, some major thinkers have denied that reason plays any significant role in the life of the religious believer. Tertullian’s rhetorical question, “What has Jerusalem to do with Athens?”, is meant to elicit the view that faith (the Jerusalem of Jesus) has little or nothing to do with reason (the Athens of Socrates, Plato and Aristotle). Tertullian would go on to say, “I believe because it’s absurd.” Pascal (1623-1662), Kierkegaard (1813-1855) and followers of Wittgenstein (late 20th C.) have all been accused of fideism (which is the philosophical equivalent of calling a US citizen a “commie” in the 1950s). Let us consider their positions.

Pascal’s wager brings costs and benefits into the analysis of the rationality of religious belief. Given the possibility that God exists and that the unbeliever will be punished with eternal damnation and the believer rewarded with eternal bliss, Pascal argues that it is rational to wager that God exists. Using a rational, prudential decision procedure he asks us to consider placing a bet on God’s existence. If one bets on God, then either God exists and one enjoys an eternity of bliss or God does not exist and one loses very little. On the other hand, if one bets against God and wins, one gains very little, but if one loses that bet, then the one will suffer in hell forever. Prudence demands that one should believe in God’s existence. Pascal concludes: “Wager, then, that God exists.”

Pascal’s wager has been widely criticized, but we shall only consider here the relevance of the wager to Pascal’s view of faith and reason. The wager is just one of his many tools for shocking people into caring about their eternal destinies. After arguing that our desires affect our abilities to discern the truth, he tries to get our desires appropriately oriented toward the truth. The wager can stimulate the desire to seek the truth about God and, after one’s desires are changed, the ability to judge the evidences for Christianity properly. So, in spite of the prominence of the wager and its apparent disregard for evidence, Pascal appears to be a kind of evidentialist after all (but not a classical foundationalist).

Søren Kierkegaard’s emphasis on the role of inwardness or subjective appropriation has played a role in his being understood as a fideist. His reaction against both rationalism and dogmatism led him to view faith as a certain madness, a “leap” one makes beyond what is reasonable (a leap into the absurd). Some philosophers argue that Kierkegaard is simply emphasizing that faith is more than rational assent to the truth of a proposition, involving more fundamentally the passionate commitment of the heart.

Finally, followers of the enigmatic Ludwig Wittgenstein have defended the groundlessness of belief in God, a view that has been called “Wittgensteinian fideism.” Wittgenstein’s later works both noticed and affirmed the tremendous variety of our beliefs that are not held because of reasons—such beliefs are, according to Wittgenstein, groundless. Many of Wittgenstein’s most prominent students are religious believers, some of whom took his general insights into the structure of human belief and applied them to religious belief. Norman Malcolm, for example, favorably compares belief in God to the belief that things don’t vanish into thin air. Both are part of the untested and untestable framework of human belief. These frameworks form the system of beliefs within which testing of other beliefs can take place. While we can justify beliefs within the framework, we cannot justify the framework itself. The giving of reasons must come to an end. And then we believe, groundlessly.

5. Conclusion

Is belief in God rational? The evidentialist objector says “No” due to the lack of evidence. Theists who say “Yes” fall into two main categories: those who claim that there is sufficient evidence and those who claim that evidence is not necessary. Theistic evidentialists contend that there is enough evidence to ground rational belief in God, while Reformed epistemologists contend that evidence is not necessary to ground rational belief in God (but that belief in God is grounded in various characteristic religious experiences). Philosophical fideists deny that belief in God belongs in the realm of the rational. And, of course, all of these theistic claims are widely and enthusiastically disputed by philosophical non-theists.

In Western European countries, religious belief has waned since the time of the Enlightenment. Yet there are counter trends. Today over 90% of Americans profess belief in a higher power. In China, after decades of institutionally enforced atheism, religious belief is dramatically on the rise. And even though religious belief has waned among professional Anglo-American philosophers since the Enlightenment, many prominent Anglo-American philosophers are theists. What conclusions can be drawn from these sociological observations? That Reason will eventually triumph over superstition as all countries eventually follow Western Europe’s lead? That irrational religious belief is so stubbornly tenacious that Reason is incapable of wiping it out? That the natural tendency to believe in God is overlaid by various forms of sin (such as greed in the West or wicked Communism in the East)? That once the evidence is made clear to a deprived peoples, rational belief in God will flourish? Of course, these sociological facts are irrelevant to discussions of rational belief in God. Yet they are relevant to this: the persistence of religious belief in various contexts will continue to spur discussions of and developments in the epistemology of the religious for succeeding generations.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. The Virtue of Faith and Other Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Adams, Marilyn McCord and Robert Merrihew Adams, eds. The Problem of Evil. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Alston, William. Perceiving God. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991.
  • Brockelman, Paul T. Cosmology and Creation: The Spiritual Significance of Contemporary Cosmology. New York: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Clark, Kelly James. Return to Reason: A Critique of Enlightenment Evidentialism and a Defense of Reason and Belief in God. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1990.
  • Craig, William Lane, and Quentin Smith. Theism, Atheism, and Big Bang Cosmology. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Davis, Stephen. God, Reason and Theistic Proofs. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1997.
  • Gutting, Gary. Religious Belief and Religious Skepticism. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1982.
  • Helm, Paul. Faith and Understanding. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1997.
  • Hume, David. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. New York: Routledge, 1779/1991.
  • Huxley, T. H. Agnosticism and Christianity, and Other Essays. Buffalo, NY: Prometheus Books, 1931/1992.
  • Jordan, Jeff, ed. Gambling on God, Lanham MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1994.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin. Arguing for Atheism: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion. New York: Routledge, 1996.
  • Murray, Michael, ed. Reason for the Hope Within. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1999.
  • Plantinga, Alvin, and Nicholas Wolterstorff, eds. Faith and Rationality: Reason and Belief in God. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1983.
  • Plantinga, Alvin.. Warrant: The Current Debate. New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warrant and Proper Function. New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Why I Am Not a Christian, and Other Essays on Religion and Related Subjects. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1957. Swinburne, Richard. The Existence of God. New York: Clarendon Press, 1979.
  • Swinburne, Richard. Faith and Reason. New York: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Wainwright, William. Reason and the Heart: A Prolegomenon to a Critique of Passional Reason. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1995.Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Reason within the Bounds of Religion. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1976.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Thomas Reid and the Story of Epistemology. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Zagzebski, Linda, ed. Rational Faith: Catholic Responses to Reformed Epistemology. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.

Author Information

Kelly James Clark
Calvin College
U. S. A.


The terms “objectivity” and “subjectivity,” in their modern usage, generally relate to a perceiving subject (normally a person) and a perceived or unperceived object. The object is something that presumably exists independent of the subject’s perception of it. In other words, the object would be there, as it is, even if no subject perceived it. Hence, objectivity is typically associated with ideas such as reality, truth and reliability.

The perceiving subject can either perceive accurately or seem to perceive features of the object that are not in the object. For example, a perceiving subject suffering from jaundice could seem to perceive an object as yellow when the object is not actually yellow. Hence, the term “subjective” typically indicates the possibility of error.

The potential for discrepancies between features of the subject’s perceptual impressions and the real qualities of the perceived object generates philosophical questions. There are also philosophical questions regarding the nature of objective reality and the nature of our so-called subjective reality. Consequently, we have various uses of the terms “objective” and “subjective” and their cognates to express possible differences between objective reality and subjective impressions. Philosophers refer to perceptual impressions themselves as being subjective or objective. Consequent judgments are objective or subjective to varying degrees, and we divide reality into objective reality and subjective reality. Thus, it is important to distinguish the various uses of the terms “objective” and “subjective.”

Table of Contents

  1. Terminology
  2. Epistemological Issues
    1. Can We Know Objective Reality?
    2. Does Agreement Among Subjects Indicate Objective Knowledge?
    3. Primary and Secondary Qualities: Can We Know Primary Qualities?
    4. Skepticism Regarding Knowledge of Objective Reality
    5. Defending Objective Knowledge
    6. Is There No Escape From the Subjective?
  3. Metaphysical Issues
  4. Objectivity in Ethics
    1. Persons in Contrast to Objects
    2. Objectivism, Subjectivism and Non-Cognitivism
    3. Objectivist Theories
    4. Can We Know Moral Facts?
  5. Major Historical Philosophical Theories of Objective Reality
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Terminology

Many philosophers would use the term “objective reality” to refer to anything that exists as it is independent of any conscious awareness of it (via perception, thought, etc.). Common mid-sized physical objects presumably apply, as do persons having subjective states. Subjective reality would then include anything depending upon some (broadly construed) conscious awareness of it to exist. Particular instances of colors and sounds (as they are perceived) are prime examples of things that exist only when there are appropriate conscious states. Particular instances of emotions (e.g., my present happiness) also seem to be a subjective reality, existing when one feels them, and ceasing to exist when one’s mood changes.

“Objective knowledge” can simply refer to knowledge of an objective reality. Subjective knowledge would then be knowledge of any subjective reality.

There are, however, other uses of the terminology related to objectivity. Many philosophers use the term “subjective knowledge” to refer only to knowledge of one’s own subjective states. Such knowledge is distinguished from one’s knowledge of another individual’s subjective states and from knowledge of objective reality, which would both be objective knowledge under the present definitions. Your knowledge of another person’s subjective states can be called objective knowledge since it is presumably part of the world that is “object” for you, just as you and your subjective states are part of the world that is “object” for the other person.

This is a prominent distinction in epistemology (the philosophical study of knowledge) because many philosophers have maintained that subjective knowledge in this sense has a special status. They assert, roughly, that knowledge of one’s own subjective states is direct, or immediate, in a way that knowledge of anything else is not. It is convenient to refer to knowledge of one’s own subjective states simply as subjective knowledge. Following this definition, objective knowledge would be knowledge of anything other than one’s own subjective states.

One last prominent style of usage for terms related to objectivity deals with the nature of support a particular knowledge-claim has. “Objective knowledge” can designate a knowledge-claim having, roughly, the status of being fully supported or proven. Correspondingly, “subjective knowledge” might designate some unsupported or weakly supported knowledge-claim. It is more accurate to refer to these as objective and subjective judgments, rather than knowledge, but one should be on guard for the use of the term “knowledge” in this context. This usage fits with the general connotation for the term “objectivity” of solidity, trustworthiness, accuracy, impartiality, etc. The general connotation for many uses of “subjectivity” includes unreliability, bias, an incomplete (personal) perspective, etc.

“Objective judgment or belief” refers to a judgment or belief based on objectively strong supporting evidence, the sort of evidence that would be compelling for any rational being. A subjective judgment would then seem to be a judgment or belief supported by evidence that is compelling for some rational beings (subjects) but not compelling for others. It could also refer to a judgment based on evidence that is of necessity available only to some subjects.

These are the main uses for the terminology within philosophical discussions. Let’s examine some of the main epistemological issues regarding objectivity, presuming the aforementioned definitions of “objective reality” and “subjective reality.”

2. Epistemological Issues

a. Can We Know Objective Reality?

The subjective is characterized primarily by perceiving mind. The objective is characterized primarily by physical extension in space and time. The simplest sort of discrepancy between subjective judgment and objective reality is well illustrated by John Locke’s example of holding one hand in ice water and the other hand in hot water for a few moments. When one places both hands into a bucket of tepid water, one experiences competing subjective experiences of one and the same objective reality. One hand feels it as cold, the other feels it as hot. Thus, one perceiving mind can hold side-by-side clearly differing impressions of a single object. From this experience, it seems to follow that two different perceiving minds could have clearly differing impressions of a single object. That is, two people could put their hands into the bucket of water, one describing it as cold, the other describing it as hot. Or, more plausibly, two people could step outside, one describing the weather as chilly, the other describing it as pleasant.

We confront, then, an epistemological challenge to explain whether, and if so how, some subjective impressions can lead to knowledge of objective reality. A skeptic can contend that our knowledge is limited to the realm of our own subjective impressions, allowing us no knowledge of objective reality as it is in itself.

b. Does Agreement Among Subjects Indicate Objective Knowledge?

Measurement is allegedly a means to reach objective judgments, judgments having at least a high probability of expressing truth regarding objective reality. An objective judgment regarding the weather, in contrast to the competing subjective descriptions, would describe it as, say, 20°C (68°F). This judgment results from use of a measuring device. It is unlikely that the two perceiving subjects, using functioning thermometers, would have differing judgments about the outside air.

The example of two people giving differing reports about the weather (e.g., “chilly” vs. “pleasant”) illustrates that variation in different subjects’ judgments is a possible indicator of the subjectivity of their judgments. Agreement in different subjects’ judgments (20°C) is often taken to be indicative of objectivity. Philosophers commonly call this form of agreement “intersubjective agreement.” Does intersubjective agreement prove that there is objective truth? No, because having two or three or more perceiving subjects agreeing, for example, that it is very cold does not preclude the possibility of another perceiving subject claiming that it is not at all cold. Would we have a high likelihood of objective truth if we had intersubjective agreement among a large number of subjects? This line of reasoning seems promising, except for another observation from Locke about the possible discrepancies between subjective impressions and objective reality.

c. Primary and Secondary Qualities: Can We Know Primary Qualities?

According to Locke’s distinction between primary and secondary qualities, some of our subjective impressions do not correspond to any objective reality in the thing perceived. Our perception of sound, for example, is nothing like the actual physical vibrations that we know are the real cause of our subjective experience. Our perception of color is nothing like the complex combinations of various frequencies of electromagnetic radiation that we know cause our perception of color. Locke asserts that we can, through science, come to know what primary characteristics the object has in itself. Science teaches us, he says, that sound as we perceive it is not in the object itself whereas spatial dimensions, mass, duration, motion, etc. are in the object itself.

In response to this point, one can assert that, through science, we discover that those subjective impressions corresponding to nothing in the object are nonetheless caused by the truly objective features of the object. Thus, Locke’s approach leads to optimism regarding objective knowledge, i.e., knowledge of how things are independent of our perceptions of them.

d. Skepticism Regarding Knowledge of Objective Reality

In response to Locke’s line of thinking, Immanuel Kant used the expression “Ding an sich” (the “thing-in-itself”) to designate pure objectivity. The Ding an sich is the object as it is in itself, independent of the features of any subjective perception of it. While Locke was optimistic about scientific knowledge of the true objective (primary) characteristics of things, Kant, influenced by skeptical arguments from David Hume, asserted that we can know nothing regarding the true nature of the Ding an sich, other than that it exists. Scientific knowledge, according to Kant, is systematic knowledge of the nature of things as they appear to us subjects rather than as they are in themselves.

Using Kant’s distinction, intersubjective agreement would seem to be not only the best evidence we can have of objective truth but constitutive of objective truth itself. (This might require a theoretically perfect intersubjective agreement under ideal conditions.) Starting from the assumption that we can have knowledge only of things as they appear in subjective experience, the only plausible sense for the term “objective” would be judgments for which there is universal intersubjective agreement, or just for which there is necessarily universal agreement. If, alternately, we decide to restrict the term “objective” to the Ding an sich, there would be, according to Kant, no objective knowledge. The notion of objectivity thus becomes useless, perhaps even meaningless (for, say, a verificationist).

Facing any brand of skepticism regarding knowledge of objective reality in any robust sense, we should note that the notion of there being an objective reality is independent of any particular assertion about our prospects for knowing that reality in any objective sense. One should, in other words, agree that the idea of some objective reality, existing as it is independent of any subjective perception of it, apparently makes sense even for one who holds little hope for any of us knowing that there is such a reality, or knowing anything objectively about such a reality. Perhaps our human situation is such that we cannot know anything beyond our experiences; perhaps we are, each one of us individually, confined to the theater of our own minds. Nonetheless, we can conceive what it means to assert an objective reality beyond the stream of our experiences.

e. Defending Objective Knowledge

Opposing skepticism regarding objective reality, it is conceivable that there are “markers” of some sort in our subjective experiences distinguishing the reliable perceptions of objective truth from the illusions generated purely subjectively (hallucinations, misperceptions, perceptions of secondary qualities, etc.). Descartes, for example, wrote of “clear and distinct impressions” as having an inherent mark, as it were, attesting to their reliability as indicators of how things are objectively. This idea does not have many defenders today, however, since Descartes asserted certainty for knowledge derived from clear and distinct ideas. More acceptable among philosophers today would be a more modest assertion of a high likelihood of reliability for subjective impressions bearing certain marks. The marks of reliable impressions are not “clear and distinct” in Descartes’ sense, but have some connection to common sense ideas about optimal perceptual circumstances. Thus, defenders of objective knowledge are well advised to search for subjectively accessible “marks” on impressions that indicate a high likelihood of truth.

A defender of the prospects for objective knowledge would apparently want also to give some significance to intersubjective agreement. Assertions of intersubjective agreement are based, of course, on one’s subjective impressions of other perceiving subjects agreeing with one’s own judgments. Thus, intersubjective agreement is just one type of “mark” one might use to identify the more likely reliable impressions. This is simple common-sense. We have much more confidence in our judgments (or should, anyway) when they are shared by virtually everyone with whom we discuss them than when others (showing every sign of normal perceptual abilities and a sane mind) disagree. A central assumption behind this common pattern of thought, however, is that there are indeed many other perceiving subjects besides ourselves and we are all capable, sometimes at least, of knowing objective reality. Another assumption is that objective reality is logically consistent. Assuming that reality is consistent, it follows that your and my logically incompatible judgments about a thing cannot both be true; intersubjective disagreement indicates error for at least one of us. One can also argue that agreement indicates probable truth, because it is unlikely that you and I would both be wrong in our judgment regarding an object and both be wrong in exactly the same way. Conversely, if we were both wrong about some object, it is likely that we would have differing incorrect judgments about it, since there are innumerable ways for us to make a wrong judgment about an object.

f. Is There No Escape From the Subjective?

Despite plausible ways of arguing that intersubjective disagreement indicates error and agreement indicates some probability of truth, defenses of objective knowledge all face the philosophically daunting challenge of providing a cogent argument showing that any purported “mark” of reliability (including apparent intersubjective agreement) actually does confer a high likelihood of truth. The task seems to presuppose some method of determining objective truth in the very process of establishing certain sorts of subjective impressions as reliable indicators of truth. That is, we require some independent (non-subjective) way of determining which subjective impressions support knowledge of objective reality before we can find subjectively accessible “markers” of the reliable subjective impressions. What could such a method be, since every method of knowledge, judgment, or even thought seems quite clearly to go on within the realm of subjective impressions? One cannot get out of one’s subjective impressions, it seems, to test them for reliability. The prospects for knowledge of the objective world are hampered by our essential confinement within subjective impressions.

3. Metaphysical Issues

In metaphysics, i.e., the philosophical study of the nature of reality, the topic of objectivity brings up philosophical puzzles regarding the nature of the self, for a perceiving subject is also, according to most metaphysical theories, a potential object of someone else’s perceptions. Further, one can perceive oneself as an object, in addition to knowing one’s subjective states fairly directly. The self, then, is known both as subject and as object. Knowledge of self as subject seems to differ significantly from knowledge of the self as object.

The differences are most markedly in evidence in the philosophy of mind. Philosophers of mind try to reconcile, in some sense, what we know about the mind objectively and what we know subjectively. Observing minded beings as objects is central to the methods of psychology, sociology, and the sciences of the brain. Observing one minded being from the subjective point of view is something we all do, and it is central to our ordinary notions of the nature of mind. A fundamental problem for the philosophy of mind is to explain how any object, no matter how complex, can give rise to mind as we know it from the subjective point of view. That is, how can mere “stuff” give rise to the rich complexity of consciousness as we experience it? It seems quite conceivable that there be creatures exactly like us, when seen as objects, but having nothing like our conscious sense of ourselves as subjects. So there is the question of why we do have subjective conscious experience and how that comes to be. Philosophers also struggle to explain what sort of relationship might obtain between mind as we see it embodied objectively and mind as we experience it subjectively. Are there cause-and-effect relationships, for example, and how do they work?

The topic of seeing others and even oneself as an object in the objective world is a metaphysical issue, but it brings up an ethical issue regarding the treatment of persons. There are, in addition, special philosophical issues regarding assertions of objectivity in ethics.

4. Objectivity in Ethics

a. Persons in Contrast to Objects

First, the dual nature of persons as both subjects (having subjective experience) and objects within objective reality relates to one of the paramount theories of ethics in the history of philosophy. Immanuel Kant’s ethics gives a place of central importance to respect for persons. One formulation of his highly influential Categorical Imperative relates to the dual nature of persons. This version demands that one “treat humanity, in your own person or in the person of any other, never simply as a means, but always at the same time as an end” (Groundwork, p. 96). One may treat a mere object simply as a means to an end; one may use a piece of wood, for example, simply as a means of repairing a fence. A person, by contrast, is marked by subjectivity, having a subjective point of view, and has a special moral status according to Kant. Every person must be regarded as an end, that is as having intrinsic value. It seems that the inherent value of a person depends essentially on the fact that a person has a subjective conscious life in addition to objective existence.

This ethical distinction brings out an aspect of the term “object” as a “mere object,” in contrast to the subjectivity of a person. The term “objectivity” in this context can signify the mere “object-ness” of something at its moral status.

Despite widespread agreement that being a person with a subjective point of view has a special moral status, there is a general difficulty explaining whether this alleged fact, like all alleged moral facts, is an objective fact in any sense. It is also difficult to explain how one can know moral truths if they are indeed objective.

b. Objectivism, Subjectivism and Non-Cognitivism

Philosophical theories about the nature of morality generally divide into assertions that moral truths express subjective states and assertions that moral truths express objective facts, analogous to the fact, for example, that the sun is more massive than the earth.

So-called subjectivist theories regard moral statements as declaring that certain facts hold, but the facts expressed are facts about a person’s subjective states. For example, the statement “It is wrong to ignore a person in distress if you are able to offer aid” just means something like “I find it offensive when someone ignores a person in distress….” This is a statement about the subject’s perceptions of the object, not about the object itself (that is, ignoring a person in distress). Objectivist theories, in contrast, regard the statement “It is wrong to ignore….” as stating a fact about the ignoring itself.

Subjectivist theories do not have to regard moral statements as statements about a single subject’s perceptions or feelings. A subjectivist could regard the statement “Torture is immoral,” for example, as merely expressing the feeling of abhorrence among members of a certain culture, or among people in general.

In addition to objectivism and subjectivism, a third major theory of morality called non-cognitivism asserts that alleged moral statements do not make any claim about any reality, either subjective or objective. This approach asserts that alleged moral statements are just expressions of subjective feelings; they are not reports about such feelings. Thus the statement “Torture is immoral” is equivalent to wincing or saying “ugh” at the thought of torture, rather than describing your feelings about torture.

c. Objectivist Theories

Among objectivist theories of morality, the most straightforward version declares that is it an objective fact, for example, that it is wrong to ignore a person in distress if you are able to offer aid. This sort of theory asserts that the wrongness of such behavior is part of objective reality in the same way that the sun’s being more massive than the earth is part of objective reality. Both facts would obtain regardless of whether any conscious being ever came to know either of them.

Other objectivist theories of morality try to explain the widespread feeling that there is an important difference between moral assertions and descriptive, factual assertions while maintaining that both types of assertion are about something other than mere subjective states. Such theories compare moral assertions to assertions about secondary qualities. The declaration that a certain object is green is not merely a statement about a person’s subjective state. It makes an assertion about how the object is, but it’s an assertion that can be formulated only in relation to the states of perceiving subjects under the right conditions. Thus, determining whether an object is green depends essentially on consulting the considered judgments of appropriately placed perceivers. Being green, by definition, implies the capacity to affect perceiving humans under the right conditions in certain ways. By analogy, moral assertions can be assertions about how things objectively are while depending essentially on consulting the considered judgments of appropriately placed perceivers. Being morally wrong implies, on this view, the capacity to affect perceiving humans under the right conditions in certain ways.

d. Can We Know Moral Facts?

For either sort of objectivist approach to morality, it is difficult to explain how people come to know the moral properties of things. We seem not to be able to know the moral qualities of things through ordinary sense experience, for example, because the five senses seem only to tell us how things are in the world, not how they ought to be. Nor can we reason from the way things are to the way they ought to be, since, as David Hume noted, “is” does not logically imply an “ought.” Some philosophers, including Hume, have postulated that we have a special mode of moral perception, analogous to but beyond the five ordinary senses, which gives us knowledge of moral facts. This proposal is controversial, since it presents problems for verifying moral perceptions and resolving moral disputes. It is also problematic as long as it provides no account of how moral perception works. By contrast, we have a good understanding of the mechanisms underlying our perception of secondary qualities such as greenness.

Many people assert that it is much less common to get widespread agreement on moral judgments than on matters of observable, measurable facts. Such an assertion seems to be an attempt to argue that moral judgments are not objective based on lack of intersubjective agreement about them. Widespread disagreement does not, however, indicate that there is no objective fact to be known. There are many examples of widespread disagreement regarding facts that are clearly objective. For example, there was once widespread disagreement about whether the universe is expanding or in a “steady state.” That disagreement did not indicate that there is no objective fact concerning the state of the universe. Thus, widespread disagreement regarding moral judgments would not, by itself, indicate that there are no objective moral facts.

This assertion is apparently an attempt to modify the inference from widespread intersubjective agreement to objective truth. If so, it is mistaken. Assuming that the inference from intersubjective agreement to probable objective truth is strong, it does not follow that one can infer from lack of intersubjective agreement to probable subjectivity. As previously indicated, intersubjective disagreement logically supports the assertion that there is an error in at least one of the conflicting judgments, but it does not support an assertion of the mere subjectivity of the matter being judged. Further, the vast areas of near-universal agreement in moral judgments typically receives too little attention in discussions of the nature of morality. There are seemingly innumerable moral judgments (e.g., it is wrong to needlessly inflict pain on a newborn baby) that enjoy nearly universal agreement across cultures and across time periods. This agreement should, at least prima facie, support an assertion to objectivity as it does for, say, judgments about the temperature outside.

5. Major Historical Philosophical Theories of Objective Reality

Any serious study of the nature of objectivity and objective knowledge should examine the central metaphysical and epistemological positions of history’s leading philosophers, as well as contemporary contributions. The following very brief survey should give readers some idea of where to get started.

Plato is famous for a distinctive view of objective reality. He asserted roughly that the greatest reality was not in the ordinary physical objects we sense around us, but in what he calls Forms, or Ideas. (The Greek term Plato uses resembles the word “idea,” but it is preferable to call them Forms, for they are not ideas that exist only in a mind, as is suggested in our modern usage of the term “idea.”) Ordinary objects of our sense experience are real, but the Forms are a “higher reality,” according to Plato. Having the greatest reality, they are the only truly objective reality, we could say.

Forms are most simply described as the pure essences of things, or the defining characteristics of things. We see many varied instances of chairs around us, but the essence of what it is to be a chair is the Form “chair.” Likewise, we see many beautiful things around us, but the Form “beauty” is the “what it is to be beautiful.” The Form is simply whatever it is that sets beautiful things apart from everything else.

In epistemology, Plato accordingly distinguishes the highest knowledge as knowledge of the highest reality, the Forms. Our modern usage of the terms “objective knowledge” and “objective reality” seem to fit in reasonably well here.

Aristotle, by contrast, identifies the ordinary objects of sense experience as the most objective reality. He calls them “primary substance.” The forms of things he calls “secondary substance.” Hence, Aristotle’s metaphysics seems to fit better than Plato’s with our current understanding of objective reality, but his view of objective knowledge differs somewhat. For him, objective knowledge is knowledge of the forms, or essences, of things. We can know individual things objectively, but not perfectly. We can know individuals only during occurrent perceptual contact with them, but we can know forms perfectly, or timelessly.

Descartes famously emphasized that subjective reality is better known than objective reality, but knowledge of the objective reality of one’s own existence as a non-physical thinking thing is nearly as basic, or perhaps as basic, as one’s knowledge of the subjective reality of one’s own thinking. For Descartes, knowledge seems to start with immediate, indubitable knowledge of one’s subjective states and proceeds to knowledge of one’s objective existence as a thinking thing. Cogito, ergo sum (usually translated as “I think, therefore I am”) expresses this knowledge. All knowledge of realities other than oneself ultimately rests on this immediate knowledge of one’s own existence as a thinking thing. One’s existence as a non-physical thinking thing is an objective existence, but it appears that Descartes infers this existence from the subjective reality of his own thinking. The exact interpretation of his famous saying is still a matter of some controversy, however, and it may not express an inference at all.

We have already looked at some of John Locke’s most influential assertions about the nature of objective reality. Bishop Berkeley followed Locke’s empiricism in epistemology, but put forth a markedly different view of reality. Berkeley’s Idealism asserts that the only realities are minds and mental contents. He does, however, have a concept of objective reality. A table, for example, exists objectively in the mind of God. God creates objective reality by thinking it and sustains any objective reality, such as the table, only so long as he continues to think of it. Thus the table exists objectively for us, not just as a fleeting perception, but as the totality of all possible experiences of it. My particular experience of it at this moment is a subjective reality, but the table as an objective reality in the mind of God implies a totality of all possible experiences of it. Berkeley asserts there is no need to postulate some physical substance underlying all those experiences to be the objective reality of the table; the totality of possible experiences is adequate.

We have looked briefly at some of Kant’s claims about the nature of objective reality. More recent philosophy continues these discussions in many directions, some denying objectivity altogether. Detailed discussion of these movements goes beyond the purview of this essay, but interested readers should specially investigate Hegel’s idealism, as well as succeeding schools of thought such as phenomenology, existentialism, logical positivism, pragmatism, deconstructionism, and post-modernism. The philosophy of mind, naturally, also continually confronts basic questions of subjectivity and objectivity.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, William P. “Yes, Virginia, There is a Real World.” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 52 (1979): 779-808.
  • Descartes, Rene. Meditations (1641). In The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, eds. J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff and D. Murdoch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975).
  • Kant, Immanuel. Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics (1783). Trans. James W. Ellington (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1977).
  • Locke, John. Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689). Ed. Peter Nidditch (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975).
  • Moser, Paul. Philosophy After Objectivity. (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993).
  • Nagel, Thomas. The View From Nowhere. (New York: Oxford University Press, 1986).
  • Quine, W. V. Word and Object. (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1960).
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979).
  • Rorty, Richard. Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Vol. 1. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).
  • Wright, Crispin. Realism, Meaning, and Truth. (Oxford: Blackwell, 1987).

Author Information

Dwayne H. Mulder
Sonoma State University
U. S. A.


Evidentialism in epistemology is defined by the following thesis about epistemic justification:

(EVI) Person S is justified in believing proposition p at time t if and only if S’s evidence for p at t supports believing p.

As evidentialism is a thesis about epistemic justification, it is a thesis about what it takes for one to believe justifiably, or reasonably, in the sense thought to be necessary for knowledge. Particular versions of evidentialism can diverge in virtue of their providing different claims about what sorts of things count as evidence, what it is for one to have evidence, and what it is for one’s evidence to support believing a proposition. Thus, while (EVI) is often referred to as the theory of epistemic justification known as evidentialism, it is more accurately conceived as a kind of epistemic theory. In this light, (EVI) can be seen as the central, guiding thesis of evidentialism. All evidentialist theories conform to (EVI), but various divergent theories of evidentialism can be formulated.

Before turning to these issues, it is worth noting that evidentialism is also a prominent theory in the philosophy of religion. Evidentialism in the philosophy of religion has its own set of controversies, but this entry will not cover them. On evidentialism in the philosophy of religion, see Alvin Plantinga’s classic article, “Reason and Belief in God.” For a more extended discussion, see Plantinga’s Warranted Christian Belief.

Table of Contents

  1. A Brief Prima Facie Case
  2. Developing the Theory
    1. The Justification of Propositions v. The Justification of Beliefs
    2. Evidence
    3. Having Evidence
    4. Support
  3. Objections
    1. Forgotten Evidence
    2. Against a Probabilistic-Deductive Understanding of Support
    3. Essential Appeals to Deontology
      1. Ought Implies Can
      2. An Evidence-Gathering Requirement
      3. Duties Not to Follow One’s Evidence
    4. A Pragmatic Reply
    5. Rationally Believing Skepticism is False
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. More Advanced Studies

1. A Brief Prima Facie Case

When we think about what it takes for one to believe reasonably or justifiably, we think that one has to have good reasons (or, more accurately, adequate reason for thinking the proposition in question is true). We think that one is not believing as one should when one believes something for no reason whatsoever or for very weak reasons. This dependence on reasons seems to be central to the very concept of justified belief. It should be no surprise, then, that the traditional view holds that one is justified only if one has adequate reasons for belief. Thus, evidentialism can be thought of as the default, or commonsense, conception of epistemic justification. Indeed, we can see the centrality of this conception of justification throughout the history of philosophy, especially in its grappling with the problem of skepticism. In order to justify denying skeptical claims, we want to know what reason we have for believing that skepticism is false. Traditional accounts have looked to one’s available evidence or reasons for an answer.

Naturally, then, we see this traditional conception reflected in the writings of many influential philosophers. David Hume, for example, writes that the “wise man. . . proportions his belief to the evidence,” and he proceeds with this as his epistemic ideal (73). Bertrand Russell endorses the view that “[p]erfect rationality consists . . . in attaching to every proposition a degree of belief corresponding to its degree of credibility,” credibility functionally depending on evidence (397-398). W.K. Clifford writes that “it is wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone to believe anything upon insufficient evidence” (518). Such quotations help to illustrate the dominance of the view that justified belief depends upon one’s having good reasons or evidence. Though this by no means settles the issue, it does provide reason to try to work out a theory of justification that appeals solely to evidence. The remainder of this entry turns toward a detailed consideration of the theory itself.

2. Developing the Theory

Richard Feldman and Earl Conee, two leading defenders of evidentialism, have explicitly defined evidentialism as a thesis about the justificatory status of all of the doxastic attitudes: belief, disbelief, and suspension of judgment. They write that doxastic attitude, d, toward p is justified for one at t if and only if one’s evidence at t supports one’s taking d towards p (15). So understood, evidentialism is not just a thesis about justified belief, it is also a thesis about justified disbelief and the justified withholding of belief. Only one doxastic attitude towards a proposition is justified for a person at a time, and this is a function of one’s evidence. Here, I focus on the core of evidentialism—the thesis about justified belief given in (EVI)—both for simplicity and because most treatments and criticisms of evidentialism focus on it. What is said about (EVI) can be extended naturally to the rest of the doxastic attitudes and thereby applied to Feldman and Conee’s explicit thesis.

a. The Justification of Propositions v. The Justification of Beliefs

Before proceeding, it is crucial to nail down more exactly what evidentialism is a theory of. As I have defined it in (EVI), evidentialism is the thesis that one is justified in believing a proposition at a time if and only if one’s evidence at that time supports believing that proposition. (EVI) does not entail that whenever one has adequate evidence for p one believes p justifiably. This is for two reasons. First, one can be justified in believing p even if one fails to believe it. For example, one might not believe p simply because one fails to consider whether or not p is true, yet one may nevertheless have good enough reason to think p is true and so be justified in believing p.

Second, one can have good enough reason to believe p and still believe it as a result of something other than this good reason. One might believe it as a result of wishful thinking, for example. In such a case, the evidentialist holds that the person is justified in believing the proposition in question but, nevertheless, believes it unjustifiably. One believes it for or because of the wrong reasons. One way of putting the difference here is by saying that evidentialism is a thesis regarding propositional justification, not a thesis about doxastic justification. That is, evidentialism is a thesis about when one is justified in believing a proposition, not a thesis about when one’s believing is justified. The latter requires not just that one have good reason to believe but also that one believe for those good reasons.

b. Evidence

As introduced above, evidentialism is a kind of theory of epistemic justification; one can formulate various divergent evidentialist theories by providing different analyses of its constituent concepts. The present section focuses on the central notion of evidence and explicates the various ways that one can restrict the sorts of things that count as evidence. Sections 2c. and 2d. turn to complexities in other parts of (EVI). Together, these three sections illustrate the diversity of possible evidentialist theories.

Evidence for or against p is, roughly, any information relevant to the truth or falsity of p. This is why we think that fingerprints and DNA left at the scene of the crime, eye-witness testimony, and someone’s whereabouts at the time the crime was committed all count as evidence for or against the hypothesis that the suspect committed the crime. The sort of evidence that interests the evidentialist, however, is not just anything whatsoever that is relevant to the truth of the proposition in question. The evidentialist denies that such facts about mind-independent reality are evidence in the sense relevant to determining justification. According to (EVI) only facts that one has are relevant to determining what one is justified in believing, and in order for one to have something in the relevant sense, one has to be aware of, to know about, or to, in some sense, “mentally possess” it. The sort of evidence the evidentialist is interested in, therefore, is restricted to mental entities (or, roughly, to mental “information”). In addition, it is only one’s own mental information that is relevant to determining whether one is justified in believing that p. For example, my belief that Jones was in Buffalo at the time the crime was committed is not relevant to determining whether you are justified in believing that Jones committed the crime.

Evidentialist theories can agree on this much while still providing differing accounts of evidence. For example, one might think that only one’s own beliefs can provide one with reason to believe something, as many coherentists do. An evidentialist might then hold that only belief states are evidential states. One’s experiences (that is, experiential states) then would not be evidentially or justificatorily relevant. The standard view of evidentialism, however, is that at least beliefs and perceptual states are evidential states. Not only what you believe but also what you experience can provide you with reason to believe that something is the case. Yet one does not have to stop there. One, for example, might also count memories, apparent memories, or seemings-to-be-true as kinds of evidence. In the end, what sorts of states one takes to be evidential will depend both on one’s intuitions about what sorts of things can provide one with genuine reason to believe and also on one’s strategy for responding to objections.

It is worth noting that while evidentialists have available many options about what to count as kinds of evidence, not just anything mental can properly be classified as evidence. In general, only those states or properties that are themselves informational (or at least can directly and on their own “communicate” information to the subject) can properly be classified as evidential states or properties. Regardless of whether one’s feeling of pain is an informational state, it does, so to speak, directly or on its own “communicate” information to one; so it is open to the evidentialist to classify it as an evidential state. By contrast, one’s ability to, e.g., identify complex geometrical shapes in one’s visual field is not itself a kind of evidence. (Even though this ability will undoubtedly provide one with evidence one would otherwise not possess.) The ability to identify complex geometrical shapes in one’s visual field is not a kind of evidence because it is neither an informational state, nor is it a state that directly and on its own “communicates” information to one. Instead, it is always something else that gets “communicated” to one via that ability. In general, therefore, cognitive abilities are not properly considered as part of one’s evidence. As we will see below, though, this is not to say that one’s cognitive abilities are completely irrelevant to justification on every evidentialist view.

c. Having Evidence

As alluded to above, not just any evidence whatsoever is relevant to determining whether one’s belief is justified; it is only the evidence that one has that is so relevant. The obvious restriction this imposes is that one’s evidence includes only one’s own mental states. One option, then, is to hold that one’s evidence at a time (or, alternatively, the evidence one has at a time) consists in all of the evidential mental states that obtain in the person at that time, including both occurrent and nonoccurrent mental states. On this view, one’s evidence includes not only one’s present experiences and those beliefs presently “before one’s mind” but also stored or standing beliefs, even if one is not presently able to recall or consciously consider them.

To see how this account of having evidence affects the consequences of the theory, consider the following example. Suppose that I believe that most television newscasters reliably report the day’s news. I find that television newscasters almost always report the day’s stories in ways consistent with that reported by other news outlets. For example, if the newscaster were to report that a fire occurred on Elm Street, I would also be able to find a report in the newspaper confirming that a fire did, indeed, occur on Elm Street. When I discuss this topic with people, they tend to agree that this is the case, and I have no strong evidence against this belief. It seems, then, that I justifiably believe that most television newscasters reliably report the news. Also suppose that fifteen years ago I heard reliable testimony that one newscaster, Mick Stuppagin, almost always provides incorrect reports. At the time, I believed that Mick was a very unreliable newscaster. Suppose, however, that although my belief that Mick’s reports are unreliable and the testimony that such is the case are still stored in my long-term memory, I am presently unable to recall them. If someone mentions Mick Stuppagin and asks whether I think he is a reliable newscaster, I may form the belief that he is a reliable newscaster on the basis of my justified belief that most newscasters are reliable.

On the view developed above, I would be believing unjustifiably, since I have outweighing evidence against p. I would not be justified in believing that Mick is a reliable newscaster even though I may be utterly unable to recall my evidence against this belief, even though my so believing may be completely blameless, and even though it may seem to me on deep reflection that I am believing as I should. Some may find this counterintuitive and, as a result, may want to formulate a more restricted account of having evidence.

One such option is to hold that the evidence one has at a time is restricted to one’s occurrent evidential states—i.e., those states involving one’s current assent, those presently “before one’s mind,” so to speak. On this account of having evidence, my stored memory belief that Mick Stuppagin is an unreliable newscaster is not evidence that I have at the present time. Furthermore, it is also not clearly true that I have as evidence my belief that most television newscasters reliably report the day’s news, and it is doubtful that my testimonial and inductive evidence for this belief is properly considered evidence that I presently have. The justificatory status of my present belief about Mick Stuppagin will depend solely on my occurrent evidential states. (The details of the case would need to be filled in order to determine whether or not the theory implies that belief is justified.)

The difficulty for this view is to show how such a restricted view of one’s having evidence can account for the justification of all of the beliefs we think are justified. For instance, we think we have some non-occurrent beliefs that are justified. We need an explanation of this. Similarly, it seems that as soon as I occurrently entertain the proposition that George Washington was the first president of the United States, I am justified in believing it, and its being so justified does not depend upon my consciously recalling anything. Those who restrict the evidence one has to one’s occurrent states need either to provide an explanation of this or to in some way explain away these common intuitions.

Other accounts of having evidence lie between these two extremes. A more typical “internalist” account might hold, for example, that the evidence one has at a time is that which is easily available to one upon reflection, so not all of one’s beliefs count as evidence that one has at a time. On this account, I am presently justified in believing that Mick is a reliable newscaster if and only if my stored memory belief that Mick is an unreliable newscaster (and its supporting evidence) is not easily available to me upon reflection. Various other accounts of having evidence can be developed that allow for varying degrees of availability or varying amounts of reflection. Guiding each account of having evidence are intuitions regarding cases similar to that above and intuitions regarding the extent to which justification is deontological.

We can conclude from the above that evidentialist theories can be formulated so as to account for widely divergent intuitions regarding cases. Furthermore, without a specific account of what it is for one to have evidence, it is not clear which proposed cases are to count as counterexamples to the theory.

d. Support

Recall that on the evidentialist view, S is justified in believing p at t if and only if S’s evidence for p at t supports believing p. We have already seen how evidentialists can provide different accounts of evidence and having evidence. The present section focuses on complexities with the notion of support.

Perhaps the most obvious issue that needs to be addressed in order to understand what it is for one’s evidence to support believing a proposition is the degree to which one’s evidence must support that proposition in order for one to be justified in believing it. Again, this will vary from account to account. One standard account understands it as follows: one is justified in believing a proposition only if the evidence that one has makes it more likely to be true than not. The likelihood of truth given one’s evidence has to be greater than 0.5 in order for one to be justified in believing the proposition, but the threshold required for knowledge might be much higher. In order to know that p, one might not merely have to justifiably believe that p; one might have to justifiably believe it to a certain degree.

This way of understanding the degree of support required in order for one to be justified in believing p is absolute, or we might say non-contextual. The degree required is the same across all possible cases. By contrast, Stewart Cohen presents a contextualist version of evidentialism. On his account, the degree to which one’s evidence must support a proposition in order for one to be justified in believing it will fluctuate with the conversationally determined standards that govern attributions of justification and knowledge. An immediate result is that one’s evidence for p may be enough to make believing p justified in one context (where the conversationally-determined standards for justification are relatively low) while failing to make believing p justified in another context (where the standards for justification are much higher). Evidentialism is, therefore, consistent with both contextualist theories of justification and non-contextualist theories of justification.

A further, more central epistemological issue regarding support has to do with the structure of justification. Evidentialism may be combined with foundationalism, coherentism, a “mixed” view such as Susan Haack’s foundherentism, or any other theory of the structure of justification. Each theory may be incorporated into evidentialism by understanding them as providing an account of the proper nature of epistemic support. Since foundationalism is far more dominant than the other theories, in what follows I will present one way of developing evidentialism with regard to it.

According to foundationalism, a belief is justified if and only if: either it is a foundational belief or it is supported by beliefs which either are themselves foundational beliefs or are ultimately supported by foundational beliefs. From the previous section, we have seen that it is only the evidence one has that is relevant to determining whether a belief is justified. Of all of this, foundationalism implies that only that evidence which is non-doxastic, foundational, or ultimately supported by a foundational belief is capable of supporting (or conferring positive justificatory status on) a belief. (Non-doxastic evidential states may include appearance states, direct apprehensions, rational intuitions, and seemings-to-be-true. For the foundationalist, some such evidential states are crucial as only they can justify the foundational beliefs.)

Assuming this framework, we can proceed as follows. In order to determine whether one is justified in believing that p, first isolate the portion of the evidence that is non-doxastic, foundational, or ultimately supported by a foundational belief. Only this is capable of justifying a proposition. Next, if the proposition under consideration is believed, subtract that belief and anything else whose support essentially depends on (or traces back to) that belief. (This last modification is intended to accommodate the foundationalist thesis that only the more basic can justify the less basic. See, for example, the discussion in section 3e. below.) Finally, determine whether this portion of one’s evidence makes the proposition more likely true than not. If so, then it is prima facie supported by one’s evidence (and thus prima facie justified). If not, it is unjustified, for it is not supported by the evidence one has that is able to justify one’s believing the proposition.

Note that I have had to add a prima facie qualification here. This is due to the, at least, apparent possibility of one’s support for a belief being defeated by other evidence one has that is neither non-doxastic, nor foundational, nor ultimately supported by foundational beliefs. An unjustified belief may be able to defeat the positive justification one has for believing p, but such unjustified beliefs have so far been excluded from consideration. In such a case, we may want to say that one would not be justified in believing p.

3. Objections

The aim in this section is to provide a sampling of objections that have been raised against evidentialist theories of justification. The aim is not to respond to these objections on behalf of the evidentialist nor to evaluate their strength. While the following are not objections to all possible versions of evidentialism, together they illustrate the difficulty in formulating a complete and adequate evidentialist theory. The chief difficulty for the evidentialist is to develop the theory in a way that avoids all such objections and does so in an independently motivated and principled way.

a. Forgotten Evidence

One kind of objection stems from the widespread occurrence of one’s forgetting the evidence that one once had for some proposition. We can distinguish between two sorts of cases here. According to the first sort, though one once had good evidence for believing, one has since forgotten it. Nevertheless, one may continue to believe justifiably, even without coming to possess any additional evidence. Evidentialism appears unable to account for this. According to the second sort of case, when one originally came to believe p, one had no evidence to support believing p. Perhaps one originally came to believe p for very bad reasons. Consequently, just after one formed the belief, one was not believing justifiably as one’s total evidence did not support believing that p. Suppose, though, that one has since forgotten why it is that one originally formed the belief and also has forgotten all of the evidence one had against it. Since it doesn’t seem as though in the interim one has to have gained some additional evidence for p, one might think that the subject of the second case remains unjustified in believing p. The relevant beliefs in both cases appear to be on an evidential par: neither belief seems to be supported by adequate evidence. The objection is that there, nevertheless, is a justificatory difference between the two cases, and evidentialism is unable to account for this.

The details of the cases proposed along these lines are crucial, for evidentialists may be able to motivate a denial of the critic’s justificatory assessment of one of the cases. This, however, is only of help when combined with an explanation for the justification of memory beliefs in general and memory beliefs involving forgotten evidence in particular.

Here evidentialists can appeal to the notion of evidence and to what sorts of states or properties are properly classified as evidential. For example, one may argue that the “felt impulse” to believe the proposition recalled from memory or its “seeming to be true” is itself a kind of evidence. On this account, in the first case one is justified in believing p because one does have evidence that supports believing p. The supporting evidence is the proposition’s “seeming to be true” or the “felt impulse” that accompanies the belief, but this very same evidence is present in the second case as well. Furthermore, this “felt impulse” or “seeming to be true” will necessarily accompany any memory belief, so there will be no cases along the lines of the second sort in which one has no evidence to support believing p. As a result, the critic’s appraisal of the second case is mistaken. In the absence of overriding counter-evidence, one’s memory belief is justified, so the correct appraisal of the second case holds that one is justified in believing p. In short, the critic’s justificatory assessment of the second case is mistaken.

b. Against a Probabilistic-Deductive Understanding of Support

A second objection targets the notion of one’s evidence supporting a proposition. As I have developed the notion of support above, part of it is given by some theory of probability. A body of evidence, e, supports believing some proposition p only if e makes p probable. If we suppose for simplicity that all of the beliefs that constitute e are themselves justified, we can say that e supports believing p if and only if e makes p probable. However, one might argue that, even with this assumption, one’s evidence e can make p probable without one being justified in believing that p. If this is so, the resulting evidentialist thesis is false.

Alvin Goldman, for example, has argued that the possession of reasons that make p probable, all things considered, is not sufficient for p to be justified (Epistemology and Cognition, 89-93). The crux of the case he considers is as follows. Suppose that while investigating a crime a detective has come to know a set of facts. These facts do establish that it is overwhelmingly likely that Jones has committed the crime, but it is only an extremely complex statistical argument that shows this. Perhaps the detective is utterly unable to understand how the evidence he has gathered supports this proposition. In such a case, it seems wrong to say that the detective is justified in believing the proposition, since he does not even have available to him a way of reasoning from the evidence to the conclusion that Jones did it. He has no idea how the evidence makes the proposition that Jones did it likely. Thus, the evidentialist thesis, so understood, is false.

The appeal to probability and statistics here is not essential to this sort of objection, so it would be a mistake to focus solely on this feature of the case in attempting to respond. Richard Feldman has presented an example which is supposed to demonstrate exactly this point. His example of the beginning logic student is supposed to show that being necessitated by one’s evidence is not sufficient for one’s evidence to support believing a proposition (“Authoritarian Epistemology,” 150). Feldman asks us to consider a logic student who is just learning to identify valid arguments. She has learned a set of rules by which one can distinguish between valid arguments and invalid arguments, but she has not yet become proficient at applying them to particular argument forms. She looks at an exercise in her text that asks her to determine whether some argument forms are valid. She looks at one problem and comes to believe that it is, indeed, a valid argument. As the argument is valid, she believes exactly as her evidence entails she should believe, but she is presently unable to see how it is that the rules show the argument is, indeed, valid. Despite her evidence necessitating the proposition that the argument is valid, it seems she is not justified in believing it.

Various responses are available to the evidentialist. One may here appeal to the distinction between propositional justification and doxastic justification in an effort to motivate the claim that the detective is justified in believing that Jones did it and the student is justified in believing that the argument is valid. When combined with a fully developed and well-motivated theory of evidential support, this may provide a response to these examples. Note, however, that this reply depends crucially on being able to hold that the logic student is justified in believing p but not justifiably believing p. This is a tenuous position, at least for standard accounts of the basing relation—i.e., for standard accounts of that which, when added to an instance of propositional justification, yields an instance of doxastic justification. The dominant view is that the basing relation is causal, and the student’s evidence for believing that the argument is valid is causing her belief, and it is not doing so in some non-standard, deviant way. The reply to the objection that appeals to the distinction between propositional and doxastic justification demands, therefore, that one also provide a satisfactory account of the basing relation, and none have so far been formulated.

An alternative response to these examples is simply to accept their lesson. One might just accept that such examples show that we need to develop a notion of evidential support that does not appeal solely to logical relations between one’s evidence and those propositions under consideration. For example, one might hold that one must, in some sense, grasp or appreciate the logical or probabilistic connection between one’s evidence and the proposition in question in order for that evidence to support it. Evidentialism allows for such possibilities.

c. Essential Appeals to Deontology

The view that justification is, in some substantive way, a deontological concept motivates the following three objections. According to a deontological conception of epistemic justification, one has an intellectual duty, requirement, or obligation to believe justifiably. Deontologists commonly hold that people are rightly praised for believing or blamed for failing to believe in accordance with this duty or obligation.

i. Ought Implies Can

Many believe that this deontological conception of epistemic justification entails that one ought to believe a proposition only if one can believe it. Put differently, one might think that one has to be able to believe p in order for one to be justified in believing p. (This second statement of the issue is more perspicuous, as I here set aside issues regarding doxastic voluntarism.) Some propositions are too complicated and complex for a given person to entertain given his or her actual abilities, and other propositions are too complex for humans to even possibly entertain. It seems wrong to say that one is justified in believing that these extremely complex propositions are true. (EVI), however, appears to imply that one can be justified in believing such extremely complex propositions, especially given the theories of evidence and evidential support sketched in section 2d. above. If, however, (EVI) does have this consequence, then one might conclude that evidentialism is false.

The argument here has two main premises. The first premise is that (EVI) entails that one can be justified in believing a proposition that it is impossible for one to entertain. The second premise is that if this first premise is true, then (EVI) is false. Because evidentialism neither rules out nor entails the motivating deontological conception of epistemic justification, evidentialists can plausibly deny either premise.

Standard accounts of evidentialism deny the first premise. According to these accounts, the proper nature of evidential support rules out the possibility that one’s evidence can support a proposition that one cannot entertain. Evidential support is, in this sense, restricted. Whether or not such evidentialist theories are acceptable depends crucially on whether evidentialism is able to accommodate this restriction in a principled way. Here evidentialists can appeal to meta-epistemological considerations regarding the nature of epistemic justification, as well as to intuitions about a sufficiently varied set of cases. For instance, the deontological conception of justification itself can motivate and help explain a companion deontological conception of evidential support. In addition, one can appeal to cases like Feldman’s logic student example (in section 3b. above) in order to illustrate how the notion of evidential support should be restricted. Together, these considerations can help to motivate one’s evidentialist theory. In this way, one can formulate a version of evidentialism that clearly does not have the consequence that one can be justified in believing a proposition that one cannot entertain.

By contrast, an evidentialist who rejects a deontological conception of justification may accept that one can be justified in believing propositions too complex even to consider and as a result may reject the second premise of the argument. Again, the theory of evidentialism itself allows this. This second response to the argument would need to be strengthened by considerations against the motivating deontological conception of epistemic justification, but considering these in this entry would take us too far astray. The crucial point to emphasize here is that evidentialism neither rules out nor entails this conception of epistemic justification, so both responses are consistent with the theory.

ii. An Evidence-Gathering Requirement

Some argue that the justification of a belief depends, at least in part, on the inquiry that led to the belief. Two ways this can get fleshed out are as follows. One might argue that only beliefs that result from “epistemically responsible behavior” can be justified. In order to be justified on such a view, one must not only follow one’s evidence but also gather evidence in an epistemically responsible way. Alternatively, one might argue that one is not justified in believing a proposition if one could have easily discovered (or should have discovered) evidence that defeated one’s present justification for it. Here, we focus primarily on the latter.

When developing evidentialism in his introductory textbook, Epistemology, Richard Feldman presents the following example.

A professor and his wife are going to the movies to see Star Wars, Episode 68. The professor has in his hand today’s newspaper which contains the listings of movies at the theater and their times. He remembers that yesterday’s paper said that Star Wars, Episode 68 was showing at 8:00. Knowing that movies usually show at the same time each day, he believes that it is showing today at 8:00 as well. He does not look in today’s paper. When they get to the theater, they discover that the movie started at 7:30. When they complain at the box office about the change, they are told that the correct time was listed in the newspaper today. The professor’s wife says that he should have looked in today’s paper and he was not justified in thinking it started at 8:00. (47)

The professor has good evidence to believe that the movie starts at 8:00, but the claim is that he is not justified in believing this because he should have (and could have very easily) gathered defeating evidence. Evidentialism does not take into account one’s evidence-gathering and, thus, cannot account for this intuition.

Evidentialism is a theory about the present justificatory status of propositions and beliefs for subjects. It provides an account of what one should now believe, given one’s actual situation. Feldman claims that this is the central epistemological question; it alone determines the justificatory status of one’s beliefs. There are other questions about when one ought to gather more evidence, but these, Feldman claims, should be carefully distinguished from questions regarding epistemic justification (Epistemology, 48). As it is, the professor is believing exactly as he ought to believe as he is driving to the theater. As a result, Feldman concludes, evidentialism provides the correct answer about this case.

iii. Duties Not to Follow One’s Evidence

The previous objection to evidentialism attempted to demonstrate that having evidence that supports believing p is not sufficient for being justified in believing p. One might also attempt to demonstrate this by providing examples that do not appeal to evidence gathering requirements. The following is one such example.

Suppose that Bill comes to possess overwhelming evidence that his recently deceased wife was having multiple affairs throughout their marriage. If he were to come to believe what his evidence supports, he would blame his children and himself. We can further suppose that he is presently so unstable as a result of his loss that believing that his wife was having affairs would cause him to seriously harm his children before committing suicide. In such a case, it is very clear that Bill ought not to believe that his wife was having affairs. Indeed, we might say that he has a duty not to believe exactly what his evidence supports. Since evidentialism implies that he really ought to believe that his wife was having affairs, evidentialism is false.

The standard response to these types of examples is to distinguish between different kinds of demands, oughts, and duties and to hold that sometimes these conflict. For example, we have an epistemic duty to follow our evidence, we have a practical duty to not always seek out more evidence for each of the propositions we consider, and we may also have moral duties to believe or disbelieve certain propositions. While these duties can conflict, nevertheless, the epistemic, moral, and practical demands on us remain. Thus, the response is that Bill does have an epistemic duty to believe what his evidence supports, even though he has overriding moral and prudential duties to believe that his wife was not having affairs. While this response is fairly uncontroversial, the crucial point to emphasize here is that such a move is itself a substantial thesis that is in need of support. We need to be shown in an independently motivated way why we should believe that matters should be understood in this way rather than in some other.

d. A Pragmatic Reply

William James has famously argued that having adequate evidence is not necessary for one to believe justifiably. James notes that our fears, hopes, and desires (in short, our “passions”) do influence what we believe. We do not proceed in conformance with Clifford’s evidentialist thesis, nor should we. Furthermore, when we are confronted with an option to do or not to do something, we cannot help but choose one or the other; the choice is forced. By failing to decide, we embrace one of the options. In such situations, it can be permissible for one to believe a proposition in the absence of sufficient evidence. More specifically, James argues that whenever we are confronted with a live, forced, momentous option to believe or not to believe a proposition that cannot be decided on “intellectual grounds” alone, it is permissible for us to decide on the basis of our “passional nature” (522).

Consider, for example, the proposition that God exists. Believing or failing to believe that God exists is a forced and momentous option. It is forced because we cannot help but choose one or the other; a failure to decide is, in effect, to choose to not believe that God exists. It is momentous since it is a unique opportunity to gain something supremely significant and only one of the options, belief, will deliver this supreme good. Contrary to the evidentialist, James argues that one can justifiably believe that God exists in the absence of supporting evidence if both believing that God exists and failing to believe that God exists are live options for one.

Here, again, evidentialists can respond by appealing to a distinction between different kinds of justification. One may be pragmatically or morally justified in believing against one’s evidence, but this is not to say that one is epistemically justified in so believing. For example, evidentialists can begin by noting that it is in some sense very reasonable to let our “passions” influence our actions and beliefs. It may be in one’s own interest to believe that one’s wife is not having an affair, for instance. We might put this point by saying that one is pragmatically justified in believing that one’s wife is not having an affair. Furthermore, the stakes might be so high that such pragmatic considerations outweigh any epistemic considerations we might have. Hence, even though one’s evidence does not support believing p (and one is therefore not epistemically justified in believing p), it may be, all things considered, more rational for one to believe p than to not believe p. Of course, nothing here turns on the content of the belief in question. Similar cases can be constructed for religious beliefs as well, and some evidentialists might want to focus on the particular nature of religious beliefs in order to directly respond to the religious case James considers. In summary, while it is true that non-epistemic considerations can outweigh epistemic considerations, the epistemic considerations remain. While it is not epistemically permissible to flout our evidentialist duties, we do think that in certain cases it is in some sense permissible to violate them. In this way, evidentialists can try to utilize a distinction between different kinds of justification in order to try to explain away the intuitions that appear to support James’ general thesis, as well as his claims about religious belief in particular.

e. Rationally Believing Skepticism is False

Keith DeRose has presented a more recent objection that has its roots in the philosophical challenge posed by skepticism. Two separate arguments are distinguishable here. First, DeRose argues that evidentialism appears unable to account for the degree to which he is justified in believing that particular skeptical scenarios are false (703-706). The specific argument DeRose presents makes reference to his contextualist intuitions. In the context of discussing theories of evidentialism in general, it is important to note this contextualist dimension of his argument, and I’ll make reference to it below.

DeRose thinks people are justified in believing, to a fairly substantial degree, that they are not brains in vats, and he thinks that any correct theory of epistemic justification must account for the substantial degree to which people are so justified in believing. In order to be an adequate theory of justification, therefore, evidentialism must show how the evidence people normally possess substantially supports believing that they are not brains in vats. DeRose claims that this has not yet been done, and he doubts that evidentialism can accomplish it adequately.

Second, DeRose claims that this difficulty highlights a fundamental complexity in the notion of evidence. In short, he thinks that at any given time we don’t have “one simple body of evidence that constitutes” the evidence that we have (704). For instance, it seems as though my belief that I have hands is evidence that I have and can use to support various other propositions—the proposition that I did not lose them in recent combat, for example. If, though, it is good evidence that I in fact have and can use, then it seems I should be able to appeal to it in order to argue that I am not a (handless) brain in a vat. It seems it should be uncontroversial that one’s evidence justifies one in believing that this skeptical scenario is false, yet justifying the denial of such skeptical scenarios is much more difficult than this implies. My belief that I have hands appears not to be able to justify the proposition that I am not a (handless) brain in a vat. In summary, when some issues are being discussed, my belief that I have hands is evidence I can appeal to, but when other issues are being discussed it appears not to be evidence that I can use. Evidentialism owes us an explanation of this.

As with most of the objections here considered, the force of DeRose’s points will vary with each proposed version of evidentialism. The central notions of evidence and evidential support do have to be explained, and they have to be explained in a way that allows reasonable conclusions about people’s typical appraisals of skeptical scenarios. As I have developed evidentialism in section 2 above, one can develop both contextualist and non-contextualist versions. This is especially important to note because exactly the sorts of considerations regarding skepticism DeRose invokes motivate contextualism in general and contextualist versions of evidentialism in particular. A contextualist version of evidentialism will hold that when skeptical scenarios are not being discussed, people are justified in believing to a very high degree that skeptical scenarios do not obtain. As a result, DeRose’s first argument is much more interesting and intuitively plausible when applied to non-contextualist versions of evidentialism.

The traditional responses to skepticism are exactly the responses that non-contextualist evidentialists have available. For example, non-contextualist evidentialists can utilize some closure principle or inference to the best explanation to try to account for the degree to which we think we are justified in believing that skeptical hypotheses are false. Whether these strategies succeed is controversial, but the problem of skepticism is a difficult and serious one, and no proposed solution is uncontroversial. It should be no surprise, then, that one may object to the consequences any version of evidentialism has for the skeptical challenge. The fundamental lesson here is that the evidentialist needs to develop these consequences and defend them.

The second of DeRose’s arguments is best understood as a demand for a fully developed and adequate theory of evidential support. We want to know how it is that evidence works so as to justify beliefs. This demand is wholly appropriate, of course, since evidence and evidential support are concepts central to evidentialism. On one standard account, I can appeal to the proposition that I have hands in order to come to believe justifiably that I did not lose them in combat precisely because I am justified in believing propositions about the external world (including, of course, the proposition that I have hands). Although, when one is trying to show how it is that one is justified in believing that one has hands, one obviously cannot appeal to the fact that one is justified in believing the proposition that one has hands. One needs to appeal to other propositions, propositions whose justification is prior to (or does not depend on) the justification of the proposition in question. All of this seems to be uncontroversial, but this is just to explain how evidence works so as to justify one in believing that certain propositions are true. The structure of justification is part of evidential support, and it is because some propositions are more basic than other propositions that we cannot appeal to those less basic propositions in order to justify the more basic ones. There is no unclarity here, but the explanation does help to illustrate why a response to DeRose’s first argument is so crucial. The story depends on one’s already being justified in believing some fundamental external world propositions. It is here that the evidentialist has to confront the skeptic and somehow explain how it is that we are justified in believing that skeptical hypotheses are false.

4. Conclusion

This brief treatment of evidentialism explains it as a type of theory of epistemic justification. All evidentialist theories are united in understanding justification as being a function of one’s present evidence as formalized in (EVI), yet many widely divergent options are available to one who seeks to develop the theory. There are competing ideas about which mental states count as evidence, different understandings of the notion of having evidence, various ways of understanding the crucial notion of support, and also various ways of relating these three central concepts. Many of the objections developed above apply only to some of these ways of developing the theory. This highlights the role they can play in one’s attempting to develop a complete evidentialist thesis. As is the case with theories in all areas of philosophy, objections such as those developed above help to guide philosophers towards more promising formulations of the theory. It remains to be seen whether evidentialism can be formulated in a way that not only overcomes each of these objections but also helps us to provide reasonable answers to other central epistemological questions.

5. References and Further Reading

  • W. K. Clifford. “The Ethics of Belief.” The Theory of Knowledge. 3rd. ed. Ed. Louis P. Pojman. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2003. 515-518.
  • Cohen, Stewart. “How to be a Fallibilist.” Philosophical Perspectives, 2. Ed. James E. Tomberlin. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Co., 1988. 91-123.
  • DeRose, Keith. “Ought We to Follow Our Evidence?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 60 (2000): 697-706.
  • Feldman, Richard. “Authoritarian Epistemology.” Philosophical Topics 23.1 (1995): 147-169.
  • Feldman, Richard. Epistemology. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall, 2003.
  • Feldman, Richard and Earl Conee. “Evidentialism.” Philosophical Studies 48 (1985): 15-34.
  • Goldman, Alvin. Epistemology and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1986.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. 2nd ed. Ed. Eric Steinberg. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Co., 1993.
  • James, William. “The Will To Believe.” The Theory of Knowledge. 3rd. ed. Ed. Louis P. Pojman. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2003. 519-526.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. “Reason and Belief in God.” Faith and Rationality. Eds. Alvin Plantinga and Nicholas Wolterstorff. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press: 1983. 16-93.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1948.

a. More Advanced Studies

While this list in no way approximates comprehensiveness, the following are some additional helpful works on evidentialism in epistemology.

  • Conee, Earl and Richard Feldman. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2004.
    • This is, perhaps, the best single work available for exploring these issues in more detail, and it is by all accounts an excellent place to start. It includes their article, “Evidentialism,” which has come to be viewed as the definitive article on the theory. It also contains other previously published articles that not only examine particular aspects of the theory but also defend favored versions as well as new, previously unpublished articles on the topic.
  • Feldman, Richard and Earl Conee. “Internalism Defended.” Epistemology: Internalism and Externalism. Ed. Hilary Kornblith. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 2001. 231-260.
    • Much that has been written on the internalism and externalism debate in epistemology is very relevant to evidentialism. I choose to include only one such article here. “Internalism Defended,” argues that evidentialism is one internalist theory of justification that is able to overcome all of the common objections raised to internalist theories of justification. Both a version of this paper and an “afterward” is included in Conee and Feldman’s book Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology.
  • Feldman, Richard. “Having Evidence.” Philosophical Analysis. Ed. David Austin. Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers: 1988. 83-104.
    • This is a sustained examination of the crucial notion of having evidence. Feldman demonstrates just how vital it is, clearly lays out the complications and difficulties involved, and defends one particular interpretation. Reprinted with an “afterward” in Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology.
  • Haack, Susan. Evidence and Inquiry: Towards Reconstruction in Epistemology. Cambridge, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 1993.
    • This is a sustained explication and defense of a novel evidentialist theory of the structure of epistemic justification. Haack terms this theory, “foundherentism,” as it blends elements of coherentism and foundationalism. This book is helpful reading for those who want to gain a more complete understanding of competing theories of the nature of evidential support.

Author Information

Daniel M. Mittag
University of Rochester
U. S. A.

Foreknowledge and Free Will

Suppose it were known, by someone else, what you are going to choose to do tomorrow. Wouldn't that entail that tomorrow you must do what it was known in advance that you would do? In spite of your deliberating and planning, in the end, all is futile: you must choose exactly as it was earlier known that you would. The supposed exercise of your free will is ultimately an illusion.

Historically, the tension between foreknowledge and the exercise of free will was addressed in a religious context. According to orthodox views in the West, God was claimed to be omniscient (and hence in possession of perfect foreknowledge) and yet God was supposed to have given humankind free will. Attempts to solve the apparent contradiction often involved attributing to God special properties, for example, being "outside" of time.

However, the trouble with such solutions is that they are generally unsatisfactory on their own terms. Even more serious is the fact that they leave untouched the problem posed not by God's foreknowledge but that of any human being. Do human beings have foreknowledge? Certainly, of at least some events and behaviors. Thus we have a secular counterpart of the original problem. A human being's foreknowledge, exactly as would God's, of another's choices would seem to preclude the exercise of human free will.

In this article, various ways of trying to solve the problem---for example, by putting constraints on the truth-conditions for statements, or by "tightening" the conditions necessary for knowledge---are examined and shown not to work. Ultimately the alleged incompatibility of foreknowledge and free will is shown to rest on a subtle logical error. When the error, a modal fallacy, is recognized and remedied, the problem evaporates.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction: The Problem of Foreknowledge and Free Will
  2. Three Kinds of Determinism
  3. The Relationship Between Epistemic and Logical Determinism
  4. Attacking the Premises of Deterministic Arguments
    1. Can a Future Contingent be true prior to the event it refers to?
    2. Can a Future Contingent be known prior to the event it refers to?
  5. Possibility, Necessity, and Contingency
  6. The Modal Fallacy
    1. The Modal Fallacy in Logical Determinism
    2. The Modal Fallacy in Epistemic Determinism
  7. Residual concerns – Changing the past; Changing the future
  8. Concluding Remarks
  9. References and Further Reading
  10. Notes

1. Introduction: The Problem of Foreknowledge and Free Will

Moses Maimonides (1135-1204) has set out the problem in the traditional manner:

…"Does God know or does He not know that a certain individual will be good or bad? If thou sayest 'He knows', then it necessarily follows that [that] man is compelled to act as God knew beforehand he would act, otherwise God's knowledge would be imperfect.…" (1966, pp. 99-100)

The argument can be extended. The thrust of the argument does not apply only to doing good or ill, but indeed to every human act, from the most mundane to the most significant. The argument could just as well read:

"Does God know or does He not know that a certain individual (let's say the Prime Minister of Canada), on Feb. 3, 2081, will put on brown shoes when dressing in the morning? If thou sayest 'He knows', then it necessarily follows that the Prime Minister is compelled to act (that is, to put on brown shoes) as God knew beforehand he/she would, otherwise God's knowledge would be imperfect. …"

The argument for the seeming impossibility of both God's having foreknowledge and our having free will has troubled religious thinkers, philosophers, and jurists for centuries.

It is clear why theologians are troubled by the challenge of foreknowledge and free will. For most religions insist that God has given human beings free will and thus human beings can choose right from wrong, and that (in some religions at least) wrongful acts are sinful and worthy of divine punishment, while good acts are righteous and worthy of divine reward. But many of these same religions will also insist that God is omniscient, that is, God knows everything (and thus has perfect foreknowledge).[1] To deny either of these claims – that human beings have free will or that God is omniscient – amounts to heresy. Yet, on the face of it, each of these two claims appears to contradict the other.

But why should secular philosophers and jurists also be concerned with this conundrum? For two reasons.

First is that many, perhaps most, contemporary philosophers and jurists are keen to preserve the viability of the concept of free will. Our legal institutions, our very sense of what is praiseworthy and what is blameworthy, turn on the notion of free will. It is at the conceptual bedrock of our civilization that persons are creatures having the capacity of deliberation, that we have the ability to recognize right from wrong, that we have the ability to choose (to a large extent) what we do (and what we do not do), and – most especially – we are responsible for what we choose to do (and responsible for what we choose not to do).

Second is that the challenge to the existence of free will is posed not just by God's foreknowledge but by any foreknowledge whatsoever. The religious version of the puzzle arises because God is said to have omniscience, that is, knowledge of everything. But the problem would arise if anyone at all (that is, anyone whatsoever) were to have knowledge of our future actions. This generalized version of the problem has come to be known as the problem of Epistemic Determinism ("epistemic" because it involves knowledge; see Epistemology). For example, if my wife were to know today that I would choose tea (rather than coffee) for my breakfast tomorrow, then one could argue (paralleling Maimonides's argument) that it would be impossible for me not to choose tea tomorrow at breakfast.

The two concepts – (i) foreknowledge and (ii) human freedom – seem to be utterly incompatible. The challenge, then, (that is, the problem posed by epistemic determinism) is to find a way to show that

either (1) foreknowledge (of human beings' future actions) does not exist;
or (2) free will does not exist;
or (3) the alleged logical relation between foreknowledge and the exercise of free will is mistaken (that is, foreknowledge is not incompatible with the exercise of free will).

Historically, some theologians have tried to solve the puzzle by invoking unique properties of God. For example, some have argued that God is 'outside of time' (or that 'His knowledge is timeless') and thus His knowledge is not foreknowledge at all, that is, God's knowledge does not occur before (or during, or after, for that matter) any events in the world. The trouble with such solutions is (a) they leave non-theistic versions of the puzzle untouched (for example, my wife's knowing that I will drink tea tomorrow), and (b) we can construct a revised version of the puzzle explicitly invoking God's timelessness, for example:

God is omniscient and His knowledge is timeless---that is, God knows timelessly all that has happened, is happening, and will happen. Therefore, if He knows timelessly that a person will perform such-and-such an action, then it is impossible for that person not to perform that action.

Some other theologians have argued that God has a 'special way' of knowing. Unlike human beings (and other sentient creatures) who must causally interact with the world (for example, read a report, see an event, examine evidence [such as ashes, skid marks, etc.]), God is said to "know directly"---that is, without the need of sensory data or of physical interaction with the world. Such a notion of 'direct knowledge' is problematic in itself; but more importantly, it is hard to see how it solves the problem at hand, indeed how it even addresses the problem. For, again, as was the case with arguing that God's knowledge is outside of time, the same two objections can be raised to this putative solution: (a') this latter attempted solution leaves the non-theistic version of the puzzle untouched; and (b') we can construct a revised version of the puzzle explicitly invoking God's "direct knowledge," for example:

God knows directly (that is, without sensory data) all that has happened, is happening, and will happen. Therefore, if He knows directly that a person will perform such-and-such an action, then it is impossible for that person not to perform that action.

Contemporary philosophers, especially secular ones, seek a solution elsewhere. We are disinclined to pursue solutions that call upon special properties of God, especially since any such solution leaves the 'secular' version of the problem untouched.

The focus of attention has shifted dramatically. Secular philosophers argue that the supposed incompatibility arises out of a very subtle but seductive logical fallacy. So unobvious is this fallacy that it escaped detection by Maimonides and hundreds (perhaps even countless thousands) of other persons. The error has come to bear the name "The Modal Fallacy."

However, before we examine the Modal Fallacy, we need to delve deeper into the notions of determinism, truth, and knowledge.

2. Three Kinds of Determinism

There are three distinct versions of determinism: logical, epistemic, and causal. Each has been alleged to pose a threat to the exercise of free will, indeed it has been claimed of each version that its existence is incompatible with the existence of free will.

1. Logical determinism is most frequently couched as the problem of "future contingents." The threat to the exercise of free will arises from the thesis that the truth-value (that is, the truth or falsity) of any proposition is timeless (that is, those propositions that are true are always true, and those propositions that are false are always false). (Note that the term "proposition" is being used strictly, as is common in philosophy, to refer roughly to the meanings of (indicative or declarative) sentences; see sec. 2 of Truth.) Thus:

If a proposition about some future action you undertake (let's say tomorrow) is true, then it is true now. But if it is true now, then tomorrow you must undertake that action, that action must occur, you are powerless to prevent yourself from undertaking that action.

(Note that "logical" in the phrase "logical determinism" is not meant to contrast with "illogical", but instead refers to a particular concept of logic, namely truth itself.)

2. Epistemic determinism has a strikingly similar formulation. Instead of simply attributing truth (or falsity) to propositions about the future, epistemic determinism concerns such propositions' being known prior to the times of the occurrences they refer to. We then get this argument, parallel to the preceding one:

If a proposition about some future action you undertake is known (in advance), then (when the time comes) you must undertake that action, that action must occur, you are powerless to prevent yourself from undertaking that action.

3. Causal determinism is the thesis that all events (occurrences, processes, etc.) are the result of Laws of Nature and of antecedent conditions and of nothing else. Thus (to cite an example made famous by Carl Hempel), when a car radiator cracks overnight, it is the consequence of laws pertaining to the tensile strength of iron, of laws pertaining to the expansion of water upon freezing, to the structure of the radiator, to its being filled with water without anti-freeze, and to the temperature's falling well below freezing for several hours (Hempel, 1942). In the case of human beings' acting, the same scenario is said to obtain.

If whatever one does is the result of Laws of Nature and of one's physical and genetic makeup and one's personal history, then – since all these 'factors' are 'set' (or 'in place') at the moment of one's acting – you must undertake the action you perform, that action must occur, you are powerless to prevent yourself from undertaking that action.

Three arguments all with the same conclusion, namely that your actions are 'determined' (in one of three different ways) and thus your actions are "unfree." Free will is an illusion.

Of the three deterministic arguments, the most difficult to engage is the third, that of causal determinism. Indeed, so knotted is that argument, and so contentious are the issues surrounding its presuppositions, it is treated separately in this Encyclopedia. (See, for example, "Laws of Nature.")

Note: From this point on, this article will examine only Epistemic Determinism and Logical Determinism.

3. The Relationship Between Epistemic and Logical Determinism

Since the ground-breaking work of Plato (427?-347? B.C.E.) most philosophers have agreed that there are (at least) three conditions that must be satisfied for a human being, let's say "x", to have knowledge of matters of fact, let's say "P":

  1. P (is true)
  2. x has good evidence, e, that P (and has little, or no, countervailing evidence)[2]
  3. x believes, on the basis of e, that P

In the case of God, one may want to drop the second condition, the evidential requirement, allowing that God knows directly without the need of evidence. The third condition, the belief-condition, poses certain problems as well. In the case of human beings, this condition captures the 'mental' or 'cognitive' aspect of knowledge. But the beliefs of an omniscient God are unlike those of human beings. The beliefs of human beings are finite, shifting, fallible, and corrigible. Those of an omniscient God are infinite, unchanging, infallible, and incorrigible. Perhaps, then, "believes" is not quite the right word to use when speaking of God's knowledge, but no other is ready at hand.

Be this as it may, there remains one common element (at least) in the case of a human being's having knowledge and God's having knowledge, namely what is known is true. Neither God nor any human being can literally know anything that is in fact false. Put another way, truth is a prerequisite of knowledge (or using the vocabulary of logic, truth is a necessary condition for knowledge). (In the case of God, truth is not only a necessary condition for His knowledge, it is also sufficient. If we let "g" stand for "God", "K" for "knows", then gKP implies P, and P implies gKP.) Someone may believe strongly that some proposition is true, indeed he may insist that he knows, he may insist that he has incontrovertible evidence that that proposition is true, but if that proposition is in fact false, then he does not know. (This is not to say that he must have some way of finding out that he is mistaken. We are here divorcing truth from belief.) Every proposition that is genuinely known (that is, to be true) is true; but the converse – namely that every proposition that is true is known – certainly does not hold for less-than-omniscient human beings.

The upshot is that the premises of the argument for Epistemic Determinism (that is, that there can be knowledge of some [at least] of a person's future actions) presuppose the premises of the argument for Logical Determinism. For, simply, if there is knowledge now (that is, prior to the occurrence) of some future actions, then there are propositions about the future that are true now. If one were able to reject the premises of the argument for Logical Determinism, one would thereby render the argument for Epistemic Determinism unsound.

4. Attacking the Premises of Deterministic Arguments

As is the case with any argument, four responses are possible.

  1. One can accept the argument. In effect, this is to say that one regards the argument as being sound, that is, as having true premises and as being valid.
  2. One can argue that although the argument is valid, its premise-set is false (and thus its conclusion is unsupported).
  3. One can reject the validity of the argument, in particular by arguing that although the premise-set is true, the conclusion does not follow from that premise-set.
  4. Finally, one can adopt both of the immediately preceding two strategies, that is, argue that not only is the premise-set false, the argument is invalid to boot.

Some religious groups (for example, the early Calvinists) have adopted the first option. They accept the soundness of the deterministic arguments and – giving primacy to God's knowledge over human beings' free will – argue that free will does not exist.

Needless to say, very few others have been inclined to adopt such a view, indeed most persons who are familiar with the deterministic arguments are strongly motivated to rebut such a view. Such persons will, therefore, examine the possibility of adopting option 2 or 3. We turn, then, first, to see whether one can cogently rebut the premises of the argument for Logical Determinism.

a. Can a Future Contingent be true prior to the event it refers to?

Propositions about future events, or, if one prefers, about future matters of fact, are known as future contingents. The earliest discussion of future contingents, and the attendant problem of logical determinism, occurs in Aristotle's De Interpretatione 9 (1963, Chapter 9, pp. 50-53). There, Aristotle discusses the case of "Tomorrow's Sea Battle." His argument, reconstructed and embellished, is this:

Two warring admirals, A and B, are preparing their fleets for a decisive sea battle tomorrow. The battle will be fought until one side is victorious. But the "logical laws (or principles)" of the excluded middle (every proposition is either true or false) and of noncontradiction (no proposition is both true and false), require that one of the propositions, "A wins" and "it is false that A wins," is true and the other is false. Suppose "A wins" is (today) true. Then whatever A does (or fails to do) today will make no difference: A must win; similarly, whatever B does (or fails to do) today will make no difference: the outcome is already settled (that is, A must win). Or again, suppose "A wins" is (today) false. Then no matter what A does today (or fails to do), it will make no difference: A must lose; similarly, no matter what B does (or fails to do), it will make no difference: the outcome is already settled (that is, A must lose). Thus, if every proposition is either true or false (and not both), then planning, or as Aristotle put it 'taking trouble', is futile. The future will be what it will be, irrespective of our planning, intentions, etc.

How might one try to rebut the premises of Aristotle's argument?

Proposal One: One might argue that propositions are not true in advance of the events described. Propositions 'become' true when the events described occur.

First objection to Proposal One: (i) Sirhan Sirhan killed Robert F. Kennedy. But when did it 'become true' that Sirhan Sirhan killed Kennedy? At the moment of his pulling the trigger? But the bullet was not yet lodged in Kennedy's body. At the time of the bullet's entering Kennedy's body? But Kennedy did not die immediately. He was rushed to a hospital where he died some hours later. At the moment of Kennedy's death? But at that moment Sirhan Sirhan was in the custody of police in a building remote from the hospital where Kennedy was. (This conundrum is the handiwork of Judith Jarvis Thomson (1971).) The point is that although it is clearly true that Sirhan Sirhan killed Kennedy, it is problematic to pin down an exact time (or even a candidate for the exact time) when Sirhan killed Kennedy and, by extension, when it 'became true' that Sirhan killed Kennedy. (ii) When did Germany lose World War II? When the Allies' invasion force landed on the beaches of Normandy? When British scientists and engineers invented and were able to use radar against the German Luftwaffe? When Alan Turing and his team broke the German secret code? When …?

The issues in the preceding paragraph strongly suggest that it will prove problematic in the extreme to try to put precise times on the (supposed) occurrence of a proposition's "becoming true." Moreover, propositions are supposed to be abstract entities, entities which do not exist in space and time; but if they do not exist in time, how can their properties change – from being neither true nor false to being true (or to being false as the case may be) – at some particular time?

Second objection to Proposal One: We do, in a great many cases, routinely ascribe truth to propositions about future events. (iii) Each year the Children's Hospital in Vancouver has a lottery in which the grand prize is a new "prestige home." Persons buy tickets on the firm belief that some winning ticket will be drawn. If the Hospital deliberately failed to draw a ticket, on the scheduled date, from the pool of purchased tickets, all those who had purchased a ticket could rightly claim that the hospital had been lying (that is, had been asserting false propositions). The ticket-holders had all assumed that the proposition "Some winning ticket will be drawn on the scheduled date" was true, weeks before the scheduled date. (iv) It is true today that there will a US presidential election in 2048. And (v) it is demonstrably true now that there will be a total solar eclipse, over parts of Libya and Turkey, on 30 April 2060 (Brunier & Luminet, 2000, pp.154-5).

Third objection to Proposal One: To argue that propositions about the future acquire a truth-value only when the described event occurs (that is, in the future) will entail abandoning the logical law (/principle) of the excluded middle: propositions about the future will not, then, have truth-values now (that is, prior to the occurrence of the predicted event). Adopting Proposal One would require our creating a far more complicated logic. This is not to say that this proposed solution is completely without merit; but it is to say that we ought to try to find some other solution before resorting to such a major revision of logic. [For more discussion of these objections, see Time: Is Only the Present Real?.]

What other way might one, then, propose to avoid the conclusion of the argument about tomorrow's sea battle?

Proposal Two: Disjunctions (that is, propositions of the form "P or Q" [in this particular case "A wins or it is false that A wins"]) are true, but not the individual disjuncts (components, that is, "A wins" and "it is false that A wins").

Objection to Proposal Two: The proposal is terribly peculiar. We are inclined to say that a disjunction is true just because (at least) one of its disjuncts is true. If neither P is true nor Q is true, how can "P or Q" be true? And, further, just as in the previous proposal, this one, too, entails abandoning the law of the excluded middle: while "A wins or it is false that A wins" has a truth-value now, neither of the two propositions "A wins" and "it is false that A wins" has a truth-value now. So, once again, we would prefer a less radical solution.

Interim Conclusion #1: It emerges, then, that challenging the premises of the argument for logical determinism – namely that a proposition about an event can be true prior to the occurrence of that event – is not a promising approach to solving the problem of the threat posed to the existence of free will. (We will return to a further examination of Logical Determinism in due course.) Since truth is a necessary condition for knowledge, if we had been able to reject the premises of the argument for logical determinism, we would, thereby, at a stroke have undercut the argument for epistemic determinism. But, at this point in our discussions, we are allowing that future contingents can be true (or false) now, prior to the events referred to. Thus we must next examine whether the premises of the argument for epistemic determinism can be true.

b. Can a Future Contingent be known prior to the event it refers to?

How might one try to rebut the premises of the argument for epistemic determinism?

Proposal One: One might argue that factual propositions are knowable only through a causal chain linking the event to the would-be knower. One can know, for example, that Mount St. Helens erupted within the last one hundred years: by hearing the reports of eyewitnesses, by seeing the event on television, by reading newspaper accounts, and by viewing the very considerable damage to the environs of the mountain. In short, we know of events by their causal remnants and since there apparently are no cases of 'backwards causation', knowledge of future contingents is impossible.

Objection to Proposal One: Even if it is granted that there are no causal remnants of future events, the conclusion that there can be no knowledge of future events is false. Examining their remnants is not the only way to have knowledge of future events. In the case of Mount St. Helens, for example, ample warning was given (a month earlier) by the US Forestry Service of the imminent cataclysm. Some of those who choose to ignore the danger signals did not live long to regret their folly.

And it is not only of impending large-scale disasters that we often have foreknowledge. Throughout our normal, even humdrum, days we depend on our knowledge of future contingents in order to maintain our lives and to avert death. When we see a bus traveling at a high speed along a highway on whose curb we are standing, we know full well that that bus is going to pass in front of us and that it would kill us if we were to be foolhardy enough to step in front of it just as it approached. None of us expects the bus suddenly, as it approaches, to turn into a slow-moving marshmallow. We know that the bus will retain its 'integrity' as a bus. Even such a simple, commonplace, act as unceremoniously opening and drinking a bottle of cola requires our knowing that it will not poison us, that it is, and will remain, potable.

Simply put, our knowledge of how the world has behaved up till now provides powerful evidence of how it will behave. That is why we teach our children not to play in the street, why we teach our children not to put their fingers into electrical outlets, why we (try to) teach our children not to drive while intoxicated, etc. Our daily behavior provides abundant and powerful evidence that we do, to a very great extent, know perfectly well what the future will be.

Proposal Two: The examples offered in the objection (immediately above) are not bona fide cases of foreknowledge; they are cases merely of strong beliefs. We may believe we know, but something 'could go wrong' between now and the predicted event. We cannot rule out our making a mistake. There is always the ineliminable possibility of error. For example, the person who opens and drinks a bottle of cola doesn't really know that it is safe to drink, that someone hasn't in fact tampered with the drink and poisoned it. Because of the possibility of unforeseen circumstances, even if they are very improbable, one cannot have genuine knowledge of the future.

First Objection to Proposal Two: Knowing a future contingent does not require that there be no possibility of our making a error. Yes, we could make a mistake, yes, something might happen that will make our prediction turn out false, but that is no reason to claim that we cannot know the future. What is required is that we have good grounds to make our prediction and that they be true, not that there be no possibility of error.

At the dawn of the 'modern' era in philosophy, René Descartes (1595-1649) began his Meditations by asking what could be known for certain. He sets as his program the elimination from his belief-system all that is not, or cannot be, known for certain.

My reason tells me that as well as withholding assent from propositions that are obviously false, I should also withhold it from ones that are not completely certain and indubitable. (Descartes, 1641, p. 1)

Given the tenor of his time, with the extraordinary success of the 'new' science, the headiness of such a claim is perhaps understandable (and forgivable). But it was, in the end, a colossal error. It was the pursuit of an impossible goal, the philosophical equivalent of placing the goalposts in an unreachable place.

The two phrases "x knows" and "x knows for certain" are no more equivalent than "x sees the distant mountain" and "x sees the distant mountain perfectly (for example, from miles away x can see the veins in the leaves on the trees)". Persons who do not have perfect pitch may, nonetheless, know when a pianist has hit a wrong note. One doesn't have to hear perfectly to hear. Two mathematicians may prove the same theorem; one of these proofs may be 'elegant', the other 'circuitous'; but both are proofs. A proof need not be elegant in order to be proof.

Similarly with knowledge. What one knows need not be certain; some, probably most, things that we know fall short of certainty, but it is arbitrary and stultifying to refuse to acknowledge these cases as genuine cases of knowledge. By setting the standards too high, as did Descartes and as do many of his intellectual heirs even today, is to rob the concept of "knowledge" of its utility.

To know the future, it is not required that we be infallible (that is, incapable of making a mistake). The person who sees a bus fast approaching knows that it will not (miraculously) turn into a marshmallow. And she is right: it does not. Realistically, few of us (unless corrupted by a bad introductory philosophy course), would be tempted to say, "She didn't know. After all, the bus could have turned into a marshmallow." True enough, there is one sensein which the bus could have turned into a marshmallow, and that sense is that such an eventuality is a logical possibility (that is, is not logically self-contradictory). Indeed it is a matter of the very definition of "matter of fact" or "contingency" that such propositions are both possibly true and possibly false. Every true contingency is (as a matter of the very definition of "contingency") possibly false; and likewise every false contingency is (as a matter of the very definition of "contingency") possibly true. [More on this in section 5 below.] But nothing of particular significance follows from these latter facts.

One must be careful not to 'slide' from "possible" to "probable". Just because an event is possible does not justify the inference that it is probable. The proposition that the US Congress will adopt Swedish as the country's sole national language certainly is a logical possibility (that is, is not self-contradictory). But that proposition has a probability, for all intents and purposes, of zero. Every contingent proposition is both possibly true and possibly false. And some propositions that are possibly false have a reasonably high probability of being actually true; while some (other) possibly false propositions have a (nearly) zero probability (/zero likelihood) of being true. The essential point for our knowing a contingent proposition is (a) our having a well-founded belief that it is true and (b) that it is true. Its being possibly false is irrelevant. Its being probably false is quite another matter, but whether it is probably false or is not probably false is not entailed by its being possibly false.

Every true contingency whatsoever, not just those about the future, is possibly false. It is truth that counts, not possible falsehood. Actual truth 'trumps' possible falsehood in the matter of a proposition's being known.

Second Objection to Proposal Two: One must be careful not to set the requirements, for knowing the future, unrealistically high. For such standards can rebound and make it impossible to know the past as well.

In the first decade of the Twentieth Century, the conductor and musicologist, Friedrich Wilhelm Stein, discovered in Jena, Germany, a copyist's version of a formerly unknown symphony. The copyist had annotated it as having been written by Beethoven. It was published in 1911 as Beethoven's "Jena Symphony". However, in 1957, H.C. Robbins Landon uncovered the original manuscript and established that the composition had in fact been written by Friedrich Witt (1770-1837), a contemporary of Beethoven's.

Clearly those who believed, in the years 1911 through 1947, that the "Jena Symphony" had been composed by Beethoven had a well-grounded belief. But, as it was to turn out, their belief was mistaken. And this little piece of history demonstrates how what we take to be knowledge of past events can be mistaken. But what moral should one draw from this story?

Although we can never eliminate entirely the possibility of our having mistaken beliefs about past events, or misleading (or incorrect) evidence for those beliefs, it does not follow that we do not have knowledge of a great many past events. There is, to cite just one instance, simply too much evidence, indeed overwhelming evidence, that Mount St. Helens erupted on 18 May 1980 for anyone to have a rational belief that we do not know that historical fact. To be sure, it is logically possible that we should be mistaken. But the probability that we are mistaken is effectively zero.

If we are to be skeptical about the possibility of knowing any future events, we would have to be equally skeptical of our knowledge of the past. And if we are not unduly skeptical about our knowledge of the past, we ought not to be unduly skeptical about the possibility of our knowing certain future events. (And as for the claim that we know far more about the past than we do of the future, one must bear in mind that we know only an infinitesimal part of what has happened in the past. Do you know, or indeed have any way of finding out, for example, the names of Leif Ericson's shipmates?)

Understand that I am not being especially skeptical about the past. All I am trying to do is to draw a parallel between knowledge of the past and knowledge of the future. The parallels are these: in both sorts of cases it is possible to have very strong evidence; in both sorts of cases it is possible to be mistaken. Possibly being mistaken is not a condition unique to claims about knowing the future; it applies equally to claims about knowing the past. But in neither case does the possibility of error undermine truth.

Proposal Three: The examples that have been given of foreknowledge (for example, of a solar eclipse) of an imminent volcanic eruption, of a US presidential election, etc., are cases of naturally occurring phenomena or of legislatively mandated events. Such events have an overwhelmingly high probability of occurring. But when we turn to cases of human beings making choices, the situation is vastly different.

Many, perhaps most, human choices and behaviors are the product of free will. Some of these choices and behaviors are conscious and deliberative considerations; others are subject to whim, to irrational desires, to spur-of-the-moment decisions, etc. None of us can know, in advance, what another person's free choice will be.

Objections to Proposal Three: This latter way of trying to undercut the premises of the argument for Epistemic Determinism works, if at all, only for the secular version. It does nothing to diminish the sting of the version capitalizing on God's omniscience.

But even if this objection is confined to the secular version, it hardly addresses the alleged conundrum. For the secular version of the argument for Epistemic Determinism does not, in the slightest, require that we human beings be able to foresee all the actions and behavior of other persons. The argument has its dreadful bite even if we are able to foresee only some of the free choices of others. And being able to do that is something that is familiar to everyone.

In the case of persons whom we know well, especially family members, we are able to know, in certain circumstances, what they are about to say or do. If my wife and I go to dinner at one particular restaurant, I know beforehand, without her telling me, what she will order for dessert (lemon pie). If I happen to glance at her shopping list before she leaves home, I can know in advance that she will return with some 60-watt light bulbs. All of these are free choices on her part; none of them is coerced or forced in any way. Yet, I do know them.

In the case of predicting the behavior of groups of persons, entire industries have grown up in the last 100 years devoted to such inquiries: professional pollsters, of course, but also economists, psychologists, political commentators, planning departments of large corporations, marketing advisers, pension-fund managers, etc., operating under a number of context-relevant constraints (for example, to minimize losses) to maximize gains, etc. Perhaps nowhere is such research of greater consequence than in planning military maneuvers (as in World War II). On that occasion, it became a matter of life and death for countless numbers of troops that their commanders correctly predicted the actions of their enemies.

Interim Conclusion #2:

Earlier we saw that there are no good reasons to reject the claim that future contingents are true (or false as the case may be) prior to the occurrence of the events they refer to. And now we see that, similarly, there are no good reasons to reject the claim that many future contingents (all future contingents in the case of God) can be, and more especially are, known prior to the events they refer to.

Thus, if we are, finally, to remove the sting of the deterministic arguments, we will have to do so by arguing that these arguments, although having true premises, are – appearances to the contrary – invalid. Each of these arguments harbors a logical slip between their premises and their conclusions. The rest of this article is given over to revealing the nature of the logical error.

5. Possibility, Necessity, and Contingency

To expose the mistakes in the deterministic arguments, we will need some tools of modern logic. Some elementary symbols will help to illuminate the concepts at play in the deterministic arguments. However, all the formulas that will be used, which incorporate these symbols, will also be expressed in English prose.

Symbol Its meaning Explanation
P, Q, R, ... propositions See (see Sec. 2 of Truth)
~P it is not the case that P Example: It is not the case that copper conducts
electricity. (Note: "P" and "~P" have opposite
truth-values – whichever is true, the other is
P ⊃ Q if P, then Q Example: If she is late, (then) the meeting will be
gKP God knows that P Example: God knows that the Mississippi River flows
north to south.

Next we need three concepts at the heart of modern modal logic. The symbols are:

Symbol Its meaning Explanation
◊P it is (logically) possible that P Example: It is (logically) possible that the United
States was defeated in World War II. (Note: Whatever
is not self-contradictory is logically possible.)
☐P It is (logically) necessary that P Example: It is logically necessary that every number has
a double. (Note: If Q is not logically possible, then
~Q is logically necessary.)
∇P It is contingent that P Example: It is contingent that the United States
purchased Alaska from Russia.
(Note: A proposition, Q, is contingent if and only if
◊Q and~Q.)

These latter three concepts require further elaboration.

P is possible (symbolized "◊P"). A proposition, P, is possible if and only if it is not self-contradictory. All propositions that are true are possibly true. In addition, some false propositions are also possibly true, namely those that are false but are not self-contradictory. Some philosophers like to explicate "P is possible" in this way: "There are some possible circumstances in which P is true". And some philosophers, adopting the terminology popularized by Leibniz (1646-1716), will substitute "worlds" for "circumstances", yielding "P is true in some possible worlds". Examples of possibly true propositions include:

  1. Ottawa, Canada, is north of Washington, DC.
  2. The Great Salt Lake is saltier than the Dead Sea.
  3. The Dead Sea is saltier than the Great Salt Lake.
  4. John Lennon was the first songwriter to travel in a space capsule.
  5. There are three times as many species of insect as there are species of mollusk.
  6. 2 + 2 = 4
  7. All aunts are female.
  8. Some pigs can levitate.

Understand that prefacing a proposition, P, with "◊" does not 'make' P possible. What it does is to create a new, different, proposition, namely ◊P, which, in effect, says that P is possible. If P is possible (for example, suppose "P" stands for "Gold was first discovered in California in 1990"), then (although P is false), ◊P is true. Or, suppose "Q" stands for "2 + 2 = 7". Then prefacing "Q" with "◊" does not 'make' Q possible. It produces a new proposition, "◊Q", which is false. Q is, and remains, impossible whether or not it is prefaced with "◊".

Everything that is actual (or actually true) is possible (that is, possibly true). But if a proposition is actually false, then it is impossible only if it is self-contradictory; otherwise it is a false contingency, and all contingencies, whether true or false, are possible.

We may ask "What color did Sylvia paint the lawn chair?" We look at the chair and see that she has painted it yellow. Thus it is demonstrable that it is possible that she painted the chair yellow. And its being yellow implies it is false that she painted the chair blue. But the falsity of the proposition that she painted the lawn chair blue in no way precludes that she could have done so. Even though false, it still remains possible that she painted the chair blue.

P is necessary (symbolized "☐P"). Necessarily true propositions are those that are true in all possible circumstances (/worlds)---that is, are not false in any. Necessary truth can be defined in terms of possibility, namely P is necessary if and only if its negation (that is, "~P") is impossible. In symbols (where "=df" stands for "is by definition"):

☐P =df ~~P

Examples of necessarily true propositions:

  1. 2 + 2 = 4
  2. All aunts are female.
  3. Whatever is blue is colored.
  4. There are either fewer than 20 million stars or there are more than 12 million. (This statement may be unobvious; but if you think about it you may come to see that it cannot be false.)
  5. It is false that some triangle has exactly four sides.

P is contingent (symbolized "∇P"). A proposition, P, is contingent if and only if it is both possibly true andpossibly false. Contingent propositions are those that are true in some possible circumstances (/worlds) and are false in some possible circumstances (/worlds). Contingency can be defined in terms of possibility, namely:

∇P =df ◊P & ◊~P

It is essential to understand that "◊P & ◊~P" does not mean "P is true and false in some possible circumstances (worlds)". No proposition whatsoever is both true and false in the same set of circumstances (law of non-contradiction). To say that a proposition is contingent is to say that it is true in some possible circumstances and is false in some (other!) circumstances.


  1. The Boston Red Sox won the World Series in 2002.
  2. It is false that the Boston Red Sox won the World Series in 2002.
  3. Steel-clad ships can float in the ocean.
  4. It is false that steel-clad ships can float in the ocean.

Modal terms and modal status

Terms such as "must", "has to", "cannot", "is necessary", "is impossible", "could not be otherwise", "has to be", "might", "could be", "contingent", and the like, are known as "modal" terms. All of these are definable in terms of "possibility".

Every proposition is either logically possible or logically impossible. And no proposition is both.

Drawing the net a bit finer, and dividing the class of logically possible propositions into those that are necessarily true and those that are contingent, we have three exclusive categories. Every proposition is exclusively either necessarily true, necessarily false, or contingent. That is, every proposition falls into one of these latter three categories, and no proposition falls into more than one.

Just as the expression "truth-value" is a generic term encompassing "truth" and "falsity", the expression "modal status" is a generic term encompassing "contingent", "necessarily true", and "necessarily false".

Finally, no proposition ever changes its modal status. We will call this principle "The Principle of the Fixity of Modal Status". And for the purposes of assessing the deterministic arguments we note especially: no contingent proposition ever 'becomes' necessary or impossible.

6. The Modal Fallacy

From a mathematical point of view, if we arbitrarily pick any two propositions, truth and falsity can be attributed to them in four different combinations, specifically

  • the first is true, and the second is true
  • the first is true, and the second is false
  • the first is false, and the second is true
  • the first is false, and the second is false

However, it sometimes happens that two propositions will have certain logical relationships between them such as to make one or more of these four combinations impossible. For example, consider the two propositions α and β.

α: Diane planted only six rosebushes.β: Diane planted fewer than eight rosebushes.

While each of these propositions, by itself, could be true and could be false, there are – as it turns out – only three, not four, possible combinations of truth and falsity that can be attributed to this particular pair of propositions. On careful thought, we can see that the second combination – that is, the one which attributes truth to α and falsity to β – is impossible. For if α is true (that is, if it is true that Diane has planted only six rosebushes) then β is also true. Put another way: the truth of α guarantees the truth of β. This is to say

(1) It is impossible (for α to be true and for β to be false).

Unfortunately, ordinary English does not lend itself easily to express the quasi-symbolic sentence (1). In symbols we can express the sentence this way:

(1a) ~◊(α & ~β)

About the best we can do in English is to create the following unidiomatic, extremely clumsy sentence:

(1b) The compound sentence, α and not-β, is impossible (that is, is necessarily false).

English prose is a poor tool for expressing fine logical distinctions (just as it is an unsuitable tool for expressing fine mathematical distinctions[3] ). But, as it turns out, the situation is worse than just having to make do with awkward sentences. For it is a curious fact about most natural languages – English, French, Hebrew, etc. – that when we use modal terms in ordinary speech, we often do so in logically misleading ways. Just see how natural it is to try to formulate the preceding point [namely proposition (1)] in this fashion:

(2) If α is true, then it is impossible for β to be false.

Or, in symbols:

(2a) α ⊃ ~~β

In ordinary speech, the latter sentence, (2), is natural and idiomatic; the former sentence (1b) is unnatural and unidiomatic. But – and this is the crucial point – the propositions expressed by (1)-(1b) are not equivalent to the propositions expressed by sentences (2)-(2a). The former set, that is (1)-(1b), are all true. The latter, (2)-(2a)are false and commit the modal fallacy. The fallacy occurs in its assigning the modality of impossibility, not to the relationship between the truth of α and falsity of β as is done in (1)-(1b), but to the falsity of β alone. Ordinary grammar beguiles us and misleads us. It makes us believe that if α is true, then it is impossible for β to be false. But it is possible for β to be false. β is a contingent proposition. Recall the principle of the fixity of modal status. Even if the falsity of β is guaranteed by the truth of some other proposition [in this case α], β doesnot 'become' impossible: it 'remains' contingent, and thereby possible.

Whatever impossibility there is lies in jointly asserting α and denying β. (See (1b) above.) The proposition "it is false that β" does not 'become' impossible if one asserts α.[4]

a. The Modal Fallacy in Logical Determinism

Some persons have been deceived by the following (fallacious) argument to the effect that there are no contingent propositions:

"(By the Law of Non-contradiction), if a proposition is true (/false), then it cannot be false (/true). If a proposition cannot be false (/true), then it is necessarily true (/false). Therefore if a proposition is true (/false), it is necessarily true (/false). That is, there are no contingent propositions. Every proposition is either necessarily true or necessarily false. (If we could see the world from God's viewpoint, we would see the necessity of everything. Contingency is simply an artifact of ignorance. Contingency disappears with complete knowledge.)"

The fallacy arises in the ambiguity of the first premise. If we interpret it close to the English, we get:

P ⊃ ~~P
~~P ⊃ ☐P
∴ P ⊃ ☐ P

However, if we regard the English as misleading, as assigning a necessity to what is simply nothing more than a necessary condition, then we get instead as our premises:

~◊(P & ~P) [equivalently: ☐(P ⊃ P)]
~◊~P ⊃ ☐P

From these latter two premises, one cannot validly infer the conclusion:

P ⊃ ☐P.

In short, the argument to the effect that there are no contingent propositions is unsound. Its very first premise commits the
modal fallacy.

The identical error occurs in the argument for logical determinism. Recall (the expanded version of) Aristotle's sea battle:

Two warring admirals, A and B, are preparing their fleets for a decisive sea battle tomorrow. The battle will be fought until one side is victorious. But the "logical laws (or principles)" of the excluded middle (every proposition is either true or false) and of noncontradiction (no proposition is both true and false), require that one of the propositions, "A wins" and "it is false that A wins," is true and the other is false. Suppose "A wins" is (today) true. Then whatever A does (or fails to do) today will make no difference: A must win; similarly, whatever B does (or fails to do) today will make no difference: the outcome is already settled (that is, A must win). Or again, suppose "A wins" is (today) false. Then no matter what A does today (or fails to do), it will make no difference: A must lose; similarly, no matter what B does (or fails to do), it will make no difference: the outcome is already settled (that is, A must lose). Thus, if every proposition is either true or false (and not both), then planning, or as Aristotle put it "taking trouble," is futile. The future will be what it will be, irrespective of our planning, intentions, etc.

If we let "A" stand for "Admiral A wins" and let "B" stand for "Admiral B wins", the core of this argument can be stated in symbols this way:

A or B [one or the other of these two propositions is true]
~◊(A & B) [it is not possible that both A and B are true]

A ⊃ ☐A
A ⊃ ~~A
} If A is true, then A must be true. 

If A is true, then A cannot be false.

A ⊃ ☐~B
A ⊃ ~◊B
} If A is true, then B must be

If A is true, then B cannot be true.

B ⊃ ☐B
B ⊃ ~~B
} If B is true, then B must be true. 

If B is true, then B cannot be false.

B ⊃ ☐~A
B ⊃ ~◊A
} If B is true, then A must be

If B is true, then A cannot be true.

In this argument, by hypothesis, either A is true or B is true, and since they cannot both be true, the second premise may be accepted as true. But none of the conclusions is true. A is contingent, and B is contingent. Yet the conclusions state that from the assumed truth of either of (the two contingencies) A or B, it follows that A and B are each either necessarily true or necessarily false. Each of these eight conclusions violates the principle of the fixity of modal status. What, then, are the conclusions one may draw validly from the premises? These:

☐(A ⊃ ~B) or, equivalently, ~(A & B)
☐(B ⊃ ~A) or, equivalently, ~(B & A)

So long as we remain mindful of the fact that "~◊(P & Q)" is logically equivalent to "☐(P ⊃ ~Q)" but is not equivalent to "P ⊃ ☐~Q", the argument for logical determinism will be seen to be invalid. Our ordinary language treats "it is impossible for both P and Q to be true" as if it were logically equivalent to "if P is true, then Q is necessarily false". But the profound difference between these two assertions is that the former preserves the principle of the fixity of modal status, the latter violates that principle. The proposition, "Admiral A wins", is contingent, and if true, then it "remains" true. Indeed this is a trivial logical truth:

(i) ☐(P ⊃ P) alternatively, ~◊(P & ~P)

The argument for logical determinism illicitly treats this logical truth as if it were equivalent to the false proposition

(ii) P ⊃ ☐P alternatively, P ⊃ ~~P

If you do not let yourself be beguiled by the invalid 'move' (inference) from (i) to (ii), the argument for logical determinism collapses. The truth of a proposition concerning your future behavior does not make that future behavior necessary. What you choose to do in the future was, is, and will remain contingent, even if a proposition describing that choice is timelessly true.

b. The Modal Fallacy in Epistemic Determinism

Let's recall Maimonides's argument:

… "Does God know or does He not know that a certain individual will be good or bad? If thou sayest 'He knows', then it necessarily follows that [that] man is compelled to act as God knew beforehand he would act, otherwise God's knowledge would be imperfect."

We can symbolize the core of this argument, using "∴" for "it necessarily follows"; and "☐" for "compelled"; and "D" for the proposition describing what some particular person does tomorrow.

∴ ☐D

There seems to be (at least) one missing premise. [In the terminology of logicians, the argument isenthymematic.] One tacit assumption of this argument is the necessary truth, "it is not possible both for God to know that D and for D to be false", or, in symbols, "~◊(gKD & ~D)". So the argument becomes:

~◊(gKD & ~D)
∴ ☐D

But even with this repair, the argument remains invalid. The conclusion does not follow from the two premises. To derive the conclusion, a third premise is needed, and it is easy to see what it is. Most persons, with hardly a moment's thought, virtually as a reflex action, will tacitly assume that the second premise is logically equivalent to:

gKD ⊃ ☐D

and will tacitly (/unconsciously) add this further premise, so as to yield, finally:

~◊(gKD & ~D)
gKD ⊃ ☐D
∴ ☐D

But this third premise, we have seen above, is false; it commits the modal fallacy. Without this premise, Maimonides' argument is invalid; with it, the argument becomes valid but unsound (that is, has a false and essential premise [namely the third one]). Either way, the argument is a logical botch.

Once the logical error is detected, and removed, the argument for epistemic determinism simply collapses. If some future action/choice is known prior to its occurrence, that event does not thereby become "necessary", "compelled", "forced", or what have you. Inasmuch as its description was, is, and will remain forever contingent, both it and its negation remain possible. Of course only one of the two was, is, and will remain true; while the other was, is, and will remain false. But truth and falsity, per se, do not determine a proposition's modality. Whether true or false, each of these propositions was, is, and will remain possible. Knowing – whether by God or a human being – some future event no more forces that event to occur than our learning that dinosaurs lived in (what is now) South Dakota forced those reptiles to take up residence there.

7. Residual concerns – Changing the past; Changing the future

It will sometimes happen that persons will painstakingly follow each of the steps of the preceding arguments that expose the modal fallacy in logical and epistemic determinism and still harbor lingering worries that the truth or knowledge of future contingents precludes the very possibility of free will

"Look", they might say, "if it is already true today (Monday) that I will do Z tomorrow (Tuesday), then surely tomorrow, try as I might, I will end up doing Z. Were I do something else instead, in effect not do Z on Tuesday, then I would change, from true to false, the truth-value that a proposition had on Monday. But that is impossible. Thus, tomorrow, my considering the alternatives – my deliberating over my course of action, my trying to make up my mind what I will choose, my trying to exercise free will – is really just an illusion. Since I can't change the past, and since it is already true before I act that I will do Z, it clearly follows that I cannot exercise free will."

To tackle this last deterministic argument, we need to discuss two matters: (1) what might be meant by the expressions "change the past" and "change the future", and (2) whether changing the future involves retroactively changing the truth-value of a proposition.

Changing the past, present, or future: The past is fixed. One cannot undo what has happened (although one can, of course, try to mitigate the consequences of wrongful acts – by apologizing, making amends, etc.)

Not even an omnipotent God can 'undo' or 'redo' the past, for to do so would per impossible actualize a self-contradiction (for example, "x occurred at such-and-such a time and x did not occur at such and such a time").

Jewish sages warn against 'prayer in vain' (where "in vain" does not mean "futile" but "contemptuously" or "profanely" [as in the Third Commandment, "Thou shalt not take the Lord's name in vain"]):

... to cry over the past is to utter a vain prayer. If a man's wife is [already] pregnant and he says, "[God] grant that my wife bear a male child", this is a vain prayer. If he is coming home from a journey and he hears cries of distress in the town and says, "[God] grant that this is not in my house", this is a vain prayer. (Epstein, 1948, pp. 327-8)

Such prayers were regarded as blasphemous since they were taken to be supplications to God that He change the past from the way it was. But not even an omnipotent God can violate the logical principle of the (law of) non-contradiction.

And yet, God-fearing persons frequently do utter such prayers. How natural it is, for example, for Believers, when knowing that their child was on board a particular ship, and learning that the ship has met a terrible calamity and sunk – with some passengers being lost and some others being rescued – to pray to God that their child is among the survivors. Is there any way to rationalize such behavior and render it non-blasphemous?

Modern modal logic again comes to the rescue. Remember, on traditional accounts, God is (along with being all-good) omniscient and omnipotent. God, being omniscient, will have known, since the beginning of time, that the parents would pray (at such and such a time) for the survival of their child. In particular, God would have known at the time of the ship's sinking that the parents would pray sometime later, and God could have chosen to answer those prayers in advance of their being uttered. On this view, God is not changing the past at all; God is making the past one particular way among the infinite number of different ways it could have been. One must attend to the modalities. Under this view, God does not change the past from the way it was (which activity would be a violation of the principle of non-contradiction), but rather God makes one possibility (the child's surviving) actual, and makes another possibility (the child's perishing) nonactual. There is no violation of the principle of non-contradiction, and the parents' prayers are not blasphemous.

And it bears emphasizing that it is not God's knowing beforehand that the parents would pray in a certain manner that 'brings it about' ('necessitates', 'forces') their praying that way. It is, quite the contrary: it is the parents praying of their own free will that God have saved their child from death that moves God to do (have done) as he did.

Similar freedoms and constraints apply to the present. On pain of inconsistency, one cannot change what is happening at this very moment. In some circumstances, and in a certain sense, one can change what is about to happen next (that is, in the immediate future). But one cannot change what is happening now (that is, at this very moment).

What about the future? Most of us believe that we can, to a certain extent, change (or affect) the future. But then we recall the proverb, "Que sera, sera" ("What will be, will be"), and we begin to have doubts. If the future will be what it is going to be, how can we change it?

Not surprisingly, the response is: "It all depends on what you mean by 'change'".

"I cannot change the future – by anything I have done, am doing, or will do – from what it is going to be. But I can change the future from what it might have been. I may carefully consider the appearance of my garden, and after a bit of thought, mulling over a few alternatives, I decide to cut down the apple tree. By so doing, I change the future from what it might have been. But I do not change it from what it will be. Indeed, by my doing what I do, I contribute – in a small measure – to making the future the very way it will be."Similarly, I cannot change the present from the way it is. I can only change the present from the way it might have been, from the way it would have been were I not doing what I am doing right now. And finally, I cannot change the past from the way it was. In the past, I changed it from what it might have been, from what it would have been had I not done what I did.

"We can change the world from what it might have been; but in doing that we contribute to making the world the way it was, is, and will be. We cannot – on pain of logical contradiction – change the world from the way it was, is, or will be." (Swartz, 2001, pp. 226-227)

Suppose that tomorrow, by the exercise of my free will, I wash the family car. In doing so, I make the future just what it was to be. But it was to be (that way rather than some other) just because I will exercise my free will tomorrow. It is tomorrow's exercise of my free will that makes it the way it will be.

In exercising my free will tomorrow (to wash the family car) have I retroactively changed the past? Have I changed the truth-value of some proposition from true to false and of some other proposition from false to true?

Semantic relations are not causal relations: Again, the English language confuses us. We say that what we willchoose to do tomorrow 'makes' some proposition true. And we might add, what I choose to do tomorrow (namely wash the family car) 'makes' the car clean.

But these are two radically different senses of "makes". The first use of "makes" refers to the semantic relation of "truth-conferring". My washing the car tomorrow 'confers' truth on the proposition that on such-and-such a day, I wash the family car. But an event's 'conferring truth' on a proposition is not a causal relation. Causal relations occur between two events (or occurrences, or states). The event of my washing the car brings about the state (or the event that lasts several days) of my car being clean.

The event of my washing the car tomorrow doesn't retroactively cause the proposition that I wash the car tomorrow to become true, nor does it change the truth-value of that proposition. The proposition that I wash the car tomorrow (that is, on such-and-such a date) simply describes what happens tomorrow. If I do wash the car tomorrow, then that proposition was, is, and forever will be, true. If I do not wash the car tomorrow, then that same proposition was, is, and always will be false.

Some persons find it easier to understand the concept of the semantic relation of 'truth-making' if the example concerns a past event rather than a future one. Consider the proposition (which is still being debated by scientists) that the dinosaurs on earth perished as a result of an impact of a huge meteor at Chicxulub, on the Yucatan Peninsula in Mexico, about 65 million years ago. If there was such an impact, and if it caused the demise of the dinosaurs, then the proposition is true (or, more specifically, always was, is, and always will be true). If, however, there was no such impact, or if there was an impact but it didn't cause the death of the dinosaurs, then the proposition always was, is, and forever will be false.

Every actual event has a timelessly true description. It is what happens (that is, what events occur)---including those that are the free choices of human beings---that "accounts for" the truth of their descriptions. The truth (today) of the proposition that John Wilkes Booth assassinated Abraham Lincoln neither 'accounts for' nor 'caused' that criminal act.

In the next few hours I will make any number of free choices. Tomorrow there will be true propositions describing those choices. But none of my choices today is 'forced' or 'caused by' my actual choices having true descriptions tomorrow. And we can generalize:

In the next few hours you will exercise your free will and make any number of free choices. Yesterday there were, today there are, and tomorrow there will be, true propositions describing those choices. But none of your choices today (whatever they are) is 'forced' or 'caused by' your actual choices having had a true description yesterday, having a true description today, or continuing to have a true description tomorrow.

8. Concluding Remarks

The argument (Logical Determinism) that a proposition's being true prior to the occurrence of the event it describes logically precludes free will ultimately rests on a modal fallacy. And the ancillary argument that a proposition's being true prior to the occurrence of the event it describes causes the future event to occur turns on a confusion (i) of the truth-making (semantic) relation between an event and its description with (ii) the causal relation between two events.

The argument (Epistemic Determinism) that a proposition's being known prior to the occurrence of the event it describes logically precludes free will, as in the case of logical determinism, ultimately rests on a modal fallacy. And the arguments that it is impossible to know the future are refuted by two facts. One is that we do in fact know a very great deal about the future, indeed our managing to keep ourselves alive from hour to hour, from day to day, depends to a very great extent on such knowledge. Two is that the objection that we cannot have knowledge of the future – because our beliefs about the future 'might' (turn out to) be false – turns on a mistaken account of the role of 'the possibility of error' in a viable account of knowledge. Beliefs about future actions, insofar as they are contingent, and – by the very definition of "contingency" – are possibly false. But "possibly false" does not mean "probably false", and possibly false beliefs, so long as they are also actually true, canconstitute bona fide knowledge of the future.

9. References and Further Reading

a. References

  • Aristotle (1963). Categories and De Interpretatione, translated with notes by J.L. Ackrill (Oxford: Clarendon Press), Chapter 9 (pp. 50-53).
  • Bradley, Raymond and Norman Swartz (1979). Possible Worlds, (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co.).
  • Brunier, Serge and Jean-Pierre Luminet (2000). Glorious Eclipses: Their Past, Present and Future, translated by Storm Dunlop (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), pp.154-5.
  • Descartes, René (1641/1966). Meditations on First Philosophy (1641). Re-written (2004) by Jonathan Bennett, for readability by students in the 21st century, from the translation by John Cottingham (Cambridge University Press), 1996.
  • Epstein, Isidore (trans.) (1948). The Babylonian Talmud, Tractate Berakoth, Chapter IX., (London: The Soncino Press [Oxford]). (Reprinted in 1978.)
  • Gettier, Edmund L. (1963). “Is Knowledge Justified True Belief?” Analysis 23, pp. 121-123.
  • Hempel, Carl (1942). "The Function of General Laws in History," The Journal of Philosophy 39, pp. 35-48.
    • Reprinted in Aspects of Scientific Explanation, (NY: The Free Press), 1965,pp. 231-243.
  • Maimonides, Moses (1996). The Eight Chapters of Maimonides on Ethics (Semonah, edited, annotated, and translated with an Introduction by Joseph I. Gorfinkle (New York: AMS Press).
  • Nagel, Ernest (1956). "Symbolic Notation, Haddocks' Eyes and the Dog-Walking Ordinance" The World of Mathematics, vol. 3, edited by James R. Newman (NY: Simon and Schuster), pp. 1878-1900. (Reissued by Dover Publications, ISBN: 0486432688.)
  • Scriven, Michael (1965). "An Essential Unpredictability in Human Behavior," in Scientific Psychology: Principles and Approaches, edited by Ernest Nagel and Benjamin Wolman, (New York: Basic Books), pp. 411-25.
  • Swartz, Norman (2001). Beyond Experience, 2nd edition.
  • Thomson, Judith Jarvis (1971). "The Time of a Killing," Journal of Philosophy, 68 (1971), pp. 115-32.

b. Further Reading


  • Craig, William Lane (1987). The Only Wise God: The Compatibility of Divine Foreknowledge and Human Freedom, (Grand Rapids, MI: Baker Book House).
  • Rowe, William L. (1993). Philosophy of Religion: An Introduction, 2nd edition (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth Publishing Co.), esp. Chapter 11, "Predestination, Divine Foreknowledge, and Human Freedom," pp. 141-154.


Nelson Pike has argued that if one adopts a particular notion of omniscience [different from the one presupposed in this article], God's omniscience does preclude the existence of human free will. Alvin Plantinga responds to Pike, arguing that God's omniscience is compatible with human free will. Finally, Pike tries to defend his position against Plantinga. The three papers are:

  • Pike, Nelson (1965). "Divine Omniscience and Voluntary Action," The Philosophical Review, 74 (Jan.) pp. 27-46.
    • Reprinted as "God's Foreknowledge and Human Free Will Are Incompatible," in Philosophy of Religion: An Anthology, 2nd edition, edited by Louis P. Pojman, (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth Publishing Co.), 1994, pp. 250-60.
  • Pike, Nelson (1977). "Divine Foreknowledge, Human Freedom and Possible Worlds," The Philosophical Review, 86 (April), pp. 209-216.
  • Plantinga, Alvin (1974). "God's Foreknowledge and Human Free Will are Compatible," God, Freedom, and Evil, (New York: Harper & Row), pp. 66-72.
    • Reprinted in Philosophy of Religion: An Anthology, 2nd edition, edited by Louis P. Pojman, (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth Publishing Co.), 1994, pp. 261-4.

Supplementary: Causal Determinism

Throughout this article we have examined two alleged threats to the claim that human beings have free will, namely, the threat posed by Logical Determinism and that posed by Epistemic Determinism. Early we hived off the discussion of Causal Determinism. For many thinkers, causal determinism poses a far greater threat to the existence of free will than does either logical or epistemic determinism. Again, as a starting point, consider reading the article, "Laws of Nature" in this Encyclopedia.


All three deterministic arguments are challenges to the thesis that human beings have free will. And enormous efforts have been expended over the last millennium, by countless philosophers and theologians, to rebut these arguments. All these efforts have been, as it were, defensive moves. And thus the question naturally arises: Is there, or can there even be, arguments to the effect that free will does exist? Is there any empirical evidence that human beings have the capacity to exercise free choice? Is the claim demonstrable that we can, at least on occasion, make free choices?

In his article, "An Essential Unpredictability in Human Behavior" (1965), Michael Scriven describes a thought-experiment which strongly supports the claim that we have free will. (See especially Section I., pp. 419-20.) Most persons will need to read this paper several times, and without a dismissive attitude, to plumb its cogency and depth. The paper is undeniably tough going, but, in the end, worth the effort needed to grasp its insights.

10. Notes

  1. Although contemporary (twentieth- and twenty-first-century) secular philosophers continue the historical tradition of talking about God as a (/the) omniscient being, one should not thereby infer that these philosophers are assuming that God exists. For contemporary secular philosophers, "God" may be regarded as shorthand for "omniscient being." Their interest is in the consequences of positing an omniscient being, not in promoting a belief that such a being exists. The latter is a quite different matter, not touched upon in this article. [ Return ]
  2. This second condition is stated loosely. Indeed, ever since Gettier (1963), a number of philosophers have tried "tightening" the conditions that are necessary for knowledge. However, for our purposes, we need not settle on whether these conditions are sufficient for knowledge. For the present discussion, we need only insist upon the first condition (namely P is true), a condition that has been little challenged in late-twentieth- and early twenty-first-century theory of knowledge. [ Return ]
  3. Just as an exercise, try to state the following formula solely in English prose:

    x = [√(y2 + z√w)] / [2.7w (a3 + log(y - 0.5z))]

    For further illustrations of the difficulty on occasion of expressing fine logical points in ordinary prose, see Ernest Nagel's celebrated "Symbolic Notation, Haddocks' Eyes and the Dog-Walking Ordinance" (1956), especially the latter section. [ Return ]

  4. The modal fallacy is hardly the only case of human beings' susceptibility to logical error. Another logical error, this one drawn from mathematics, which – like the modal fallacy – took centuries to be corrected, has to do with the number of numbers. If one were to ask most persons, "Are there more even and odd positive integers (1, 2, 3, 4, …) than there are even positive integers (2, 4, 6, 8, …) alone?", one would likely get as an answer, "Yes, of course." There are twice as many even and odd positive integers together as there are even positive integers alone." But contrary to our untutored intuitions, this is the wrong answer. It turns out, as was discovered and proved in the 19th century (by Georg Cantor [1845-1918]), there are exactly as many even positive integers as there are even and odd together. The two classes, that of all the positive integers and that of the even positive integers are said to be "equinumerous," that is, both classes contain the same number (cardinality) of members, namely an infinite number. That there are as many even positive integers as there are positive integers can be demonstrated by the fact that the members of the two classes can be uniquely 'paired off', or putting the point in more technical jargon, the members of the two classes can be put into a "one-to-one correspondence":
    1 2 3 4 . . . .
    | | | | | | etc.
    2 4 6 8 . . . .

    Every positive integer has a unique double; and every even positive integer has a unique half which is also an integer. Clearly, there are instances when some of our untutored, deeply ingrained, logical (and mathematical) "intuitions" need to be reformed.[ Return ]

Author Information

Norman Swartz
Simon Fraser University

Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889—1951)

Ludwig WittgensteinLudwig Wittgenstein is one of the most influential philosophers of the twentieth century, and regarded by some as the most important since Immanuel Kant. His early work was influenced by that of Arthur Schopenhauer and, especially, by his teacher Bertrand Russell and by Gottlob Frege, who became something of a friend. This work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, the only philosophy book that Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. It claimed to solve all the major problems of philosophy and was held in especially high esteem by the anti-metaphysical logical positivists. The Tractatus is based on the idea that philosophical problems arise from misunderstandings of the logic of language, and it tries to show what this logic is. Wittgenstein's later work, principally his Philosophical Investigations, shares this concern with logic and language, but takes a different, less technical, approach to philosophical problems. This book helped to inspire so-called ordinary language philosophy. This style of doing philosophy has fallen somewhat out of favor, but Wittgenstein's work on rule-following and private language is still considered important, and his later philosophy is influential in a growing number of fields outside philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus
  3. Ethics and Religion
  4. Conception of Philosophy
  5. Meaning
  6. Rules and Private Language
  7. Realism and Anti-Realism
  8. Certainty
  9. Continuity
  10. Wittgenstein in History
  11. References and Further Reading
    1. Wittgenstein’s Main Works
    2. Some Biographies of Wittgenstein
    3. Secondary Works

1. Life

Ludwig Josef Johann Wittgenstein, born on April 26th 1889 in Vienna, Austria, was a charismatic enigma. He has been something of a cult figure but shunned publicity and even built an isolated hut in Norway to live in complete seclusion. His sexuality was ambiguous but he was probably gay; how actively so is still a matter of controversy. His life seems to have been dominated by an obsession with moral and philosophical perfection, summed up in the subtitle of Ray Monk's excellent biography Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius.

His concern with moral perfection led Wittgenstein at one point to insist on confessing to several people various sins, including that of allowing others to underestimate the extent of his 'Jewishness'. His father Karl Wittgenstein's parents were born Jewish but converted to Protestantism and his mother Leopoldine (nee Kalmus) was Catholic, but her father was of Jewish descent. Wittgenstein himself was baptized in a Catholic church and was given a Catholic burial, although between baptism and burial he was neither a practicing nor a believing Catholic.

The Wittgenstein family was large and wealthy. Karl Wittgenstein was one of the most successful businessmen in the Austro-Hungarian Empire, leading the iron and steel industry there. The Wittgensteins' home attracted people of culture, especially musicians, including the composer Johannes Brahms, who was a friend of the family. Music remained important to Wittgenstein throughout his life. So did darker matters. Ludwig was the youngest of eight children, and of his four brothers, three committed suicide.

As for his career, Wittgenstein studied mechanical engineering in Berlin and in 1908 went to Manchester, England to do research in aeronautics, experimenting with kites. His interest in engineering led to an interest in mathematics which in turn got him thinking about philosophical questions about the foundations of mathematics. He visited the mathematician and philosopher Gottlob Frege (1848-1925), who recommended that he study with Bertrand Russell (1872-1970) in Cambridge. At Cambridge Wittgenstein greatly impressed Russell and G.E. Moore (1873- 1958), and began work on logic.

When his father died in 1913 Wittgenstein inherited a fortune, which he quickly gave away. When war broke out the next year, he volunteered for the Austrian army. He continued his philosophical work and won several medals for bravery during the war. The result of his thinking on logic was the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus which was eventually published in English in 1922 with Russell's help. This was the only book Wittgenstein published during his lifetime. Having thus, in his opinion, solved all the problems of philosophy, Wittgenstein became an elementary school teacher in rural Austria, where his approach was strict and unpopular, but apparently effective. He spent 1926-28 meticulously designing and building an austere house in Vienna for his sister Gretl.

In 1929 he returned to Cambridge to teach at Trinity College, recognizing that in fact he had more work to do in philosophy. He became professor of philosophy at Cambridge in 1939. During World War II he worked as a hospital porter in London and as a research technician in Newcastle. After the war he returned to university teaching but resigned his professorship in 1947 to concentrate on writing. Much of this he did in Ireland, preferring isolated rural places for his work. By 1949 he had written all the material that was published after his death as Philosophical Investigations, arguably his most important work. He spent the last two years of his life in Vienna, Oxford and Cambridge and kept working until he died of prostate cancer in Cambridge in April 1951. His work from these last years has been published as On Certainty. His last words were, "Tell them I've had a wonderful life."

2. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus

Wittgenstein told Ludwig von Ficker that the point of the Tractatus was ethical. In the preface to the book he says that its value consists in two things: "that thoughts are expressed in it" and "that it shows how little is achieved when these problems are solved." The problems he refers to are the problems of philosophy defined, we may suppose, by the work of Frege and Russell, and perhaps also Schopenhauer. At the end of the book Wittgenstein says "My propositions serve as elucidations in the following way: anyone who understands me eventually recognizes them as nonsensical" [emphasis added]. What to make of the Tractatus, its author, and the propositions it contains, then, is no easy matter.

The book certainly does not seem to be about ethics. It consists of numbered propositions in seven sets. Proposition 1.2 belongs to the first set and is a comment on proposition 1. Proposition 1.21 is about proposition 1.2, and so on. The seventh set contains only one proposition, the famous "What we cannot speak about we must pass over in silence."

Some important and representative propositions from the book are these:

1 The world is all that is the case.
4.01 A proposition is a picture of reality.
4.0312 ...My fundamental idea is that the 'logical constants' are not representatives; that there can be no representatives of the logic of facts.
4.121 ...Propositions show the logical form of reality. They display it.
4.1212 What can be shown, cannot be said.
4.5 ...The general form of a proposition is: This is how things stand.
5.43 ...all the propositions of logic say the same thing, to wit nothing.
5.4711 To give the essence of a proposition means to give the essence of all description, and thus the essence of the world.
5.6 The limits of my language mean the limits of my world.

Here and elsewhere in the Tractatus Wittgenstein seems to be saying that the essence of the world and of life is: This is how things are. One is tempted to add "--deal with it." That seems to fit what Cora Diamond has called his "accept and endure" ethics, but he says that the propositions of the Tractatus are meaningless, not profound insights, ethical or otherwise. What are we to make of this?

Many commentators ignore or dismiss what Wittgenstein said about his work and its aims, and instead look for regular philosophical theories in his work. The most famous of these in the Tractatus is the "picture theory" of meaning. According to this theory propositions are meaningful insofar as they picture states of affairs or matters of empirical fact. Anything normative, supernatural or (one might say) metaphysical must, it therefore seems, be nonsense. This has been an influential reading of parts of the Tractatus. Unfortunately, this reading leads to serious problems since by its own lights the Tractatus' use of words like "object," "reality" and "world" is illegitimate. These concepts are purely formal or a priori. A statement such as "There are objects in the world" does not picture a state of affairs. Rather it is, as it were, presupposed by the notion of a state of affairs. The "picture theory" therefore denies sense to just the kind of statements of which the Tractatus is composed, to the framework supporting the picture theory itself. In this way the Tractatus pulls the rug out from under its own feet.

If the propositions of the Tractatus are nonsensical then they surely cannot put forward the picture theory of meaning, or any other theory. Nonsense is nonsense. However, this is not to say that the Tractatus itself is without value. Wittgenstein's aim seems to have been to show up as nonsense the things that philosophers (himself included) are tempted to say. Philosophical theories, he suggests, are attempts to answer questions that are not really questions at all (they are nonsense), or to solve problems that are not really problems. He says in proposition 4.003 that:

Most of the propositions and questions of philosophers arise from our failure to understand the logic of our language. (They belong to the same class as the question whether the good is more or less identical than the beautiful.) And it is not surprising that the deepest problems are in fact not problems at all.

Philosophers, then, have the task of presenting the logic of our language clearly. This will not solve important problems but it will show that some things that we take to be important problems are really not problems at all. The gain is not wisdom but an absence of confusion. This is not a rejection of philosophy or logic. Wittgenstein took philosophical puzzlement very seriously indeed, but he thought that it needed dissolving by analysis rather than solving by the production of theories. The Tractatus presents itself as a key for untying a series of knots both profound and highly technical.

3. Ethics and Religion

Wittgenstein had a lifelong interest in religion and claimed to see every problem from a religious point of view, but never committed himself to any formal religion. His various remarks on ethics also suggest a particular point of view, and Wittgenstein often spoke of ethics and religion together. This point of view or attitude can be seen in the four main themes that run through Wittgenstein's writings on ethics and religion: goodness, value or meaning are not to be found in the world; living the right way involves acceptance of or agreement with the world, or life, or God's will, or fate; one who lives this way will see the world as a miracle; there is no answer to the problem of life--the solution is the disappearance of the problem.

Certainly Wittgenstein worried about being morally good or even perfect, and he had great respect for sincere religious conviction, but he also said, in his 1929 lecture on ethics, that "the tendency of all men who ever tried to write or talk Ethics or Religion was to run against the boundaries of language," i.e. to talk or write nonsense. This gives support to the view that Wittgenstein believed in mystical truths that somehow cannot be expressed meaningfully but that are of the utmost importance. It is hard to conceive, though, what these 'truths' might be.

An alternative view is that Wittgenstein believed that there is really nothing to say about ethics. This would explain why he wrote less and less about ethics as his life wore on. His "accept and endure" attitude and belief in going "the bloody hard way" are evident in all his work, especially after the Tractatus. Wittgenstein wants his reader not to think (too much) but to look at the "language games" (any practices that involve language) that give rise to philosophical (personal, existential, spiritual) problems. His approach to such problems is painstaking, thorough, open-eyed and receptive. His ethical attitude is an integral part of his method and shows itself as such.

But there is little to say about such an attitude short of recommending it. In Culture and Value p.29e Wittgenstein writes:

Rules of life are dressed up in pictures. And these pictures can only serve to describe what we are to do, not justify it. Because they could provide a justification only if they held good in other respects as well. I can say: "Thank these bees for their honey as though they were kind people who have prepared it for you"; that is intelligible and describes how I should like you to conduct yourself. But I cannot say: "Thank them because, look, how kind they are!"--since the next moment they may sting you.

In a world of contingency one cannot prove that a particular attitude is the correct one to take. If this suggests relativism, it should be remembered that it too is just one more attitude or point of view, and one without the rich tradition and accumulated wisdom, philosophical reasoning and personal experience of, say, orthodox Christianity or Judaism. Indeed crude relativism, the universal judgement that one cannot make universal judgements, is self- contradictory. Whether Wittgenstein's views suggest a more sophisticated form of relativism is another matter, but the spirit of relativism seems far from Wittgenstein's conservatism and absolute intolerance of his own moral shortcomings. Compare the tolerance that motivates relativism with Wittgenstein's assertion to Russell that he would prefer "by far" an organization dedicated to war and slavery to one dedicated to peace and freedom. (This assertion, however, should not be taken literally: Wittgenstein was no war-monger and even recommended letting oneself be massacred rather than taking part in hand-to-hand combat. It was apparently the complacency, and perhaps the self-righteousness, of Russell's liberal cause that Wittgenstein objected to.)

With regard to religion, Wittgenstein is often considered a kind of Anti-Realist (see below for more on this). He opposed interpretations of religion that emphasize doctrine or philosophical arguments intended to prove God's existence, but was greatly drawn to religious rituals and symbols, and considered becoming a priest. He likened the ritual of religion to a great gesture, as when one kisses a photograph. This is not based on the false belief that the person in the photograph will feel the kiss or return it, nor is it based on any other belief. Neither is the kiss just a substitute for a particular phrase, like "I love you." Like the kiss, religious activity does express an attitude, but it is not just the expression of an attitude in the sense that several other forms of expression might do just as well. There might be no substitute that would do. The same might be said of the whole language-game (or games) of religion, but this is a controversial point. If religious utterances, such as "God exists," are treated as gestures of a certain kind then this seems not to be treating them as literal statements. Many religious believers, including Wittgensteinian ones, would object strongly to this. There is room, though, for a good deal of sophisticated disagreement about what it means to take a statement literally. For instance, Charles Taylor's view, roughly, is that the real is whatever will not go away. If we cannot reduce talk about God to anything else, or replace it, or prove it false, then perhaps God is as real as anything else.

4. Conception of Philosophy

Wittgenstein's view of what philosophy is, or should be, changed little over his life. In the Tractatus he says at 4.111 that "philosophy is not one of the natural sciences," and at 4.112 "Philosophy aims at the logical clarification of thoughts." Philosophy is not descriptive but elucidatory. Its aim is to clear up muddle and confusion. It follows that philosophers should not concern themselves so much with what is actual, keeping up with the latest popularizations of science, say, which Wittgenstein despised. The philosopher's proper concern is with what is possible, or rather with what is conceivable. This depends on our concepts and the ways they fit together as seen in language. What is conceivable and what is not, what makes sense and what does not, depends on the rules of language, of grammar.

In Philosophical Investigations Sect. 90 Wittgenstein says:

Our investigation is a grammatical one. Such an investigation sheds light on our problem by clearing misunderstandings away. Misunderstandings concerning the use of words, caused, among other things, by certain analogies between the forms of expression in different regions of language.

The similarities between the sentences "I'll keep it in mind" and "I'll keep it in this box," for instance, (along with many others) can lead one to think of the mind as a thing something like a box with contents of its own. The nature of this box and its mental contents can then seem very mysterious. Wittgenstein suggests that one way, at least, to deal with such mysteries is to recall the different things one says about minds, memories, thoughts and so on, in a variety of contexts.

What one says, or what people in general say, can change. Ways of life and uses of language change, so meanings change, but not utterly and instantaneously. Things shift and evolve, but rarely if ever so drastically that we lose all grip on meaning. So there is no timeless essence of at least some and perhaps all concepts, but we still understand one another well enough most of the time.

When nonsense is spoken or written, or when something just seems fishy, we can sniff it out. The road out of confusion can be a long and difficult one, hence the need for constant attention to detail and particular examples rather than generalizations, which tend to be vague and therefore potentially misleading. The slower the route, the surer the safety at the end of it. That is why Wittgenstein said that in philosophy the winner is the one who finishes last. But we cannot escape language or the confusions to which it gives rise, except by dying. In the meantime, Wittgenstein offers four main methods to avoid philosophical confusion, as described by Norman Malcolm: describing circumstances in which a seemingly problematic expression might actually be used in everyday life, comparing our use of words with imaginary language games, imagining fictitious natural history, and explaining psychologically the temptation to use a certain expression inappropriately.

The complex, intertwined relationship between a language and the form of life that goes with it means that problems arising from language cannot just be set aside--they infect our lives, making us live in confusion. We might find our way back to the right path, but there is no guarantee that we will never again stray. In this sense there can be no progress in philosophy.

In 1931 Wittgenstein described his task thus:

Language sets everyone the same traps; it is an immense network of easily accessible wrong turnings. And so we watch one man after another walking down the same paths and we know in advance where he will branch off, where walk straight on without noticing the side turning, etc. etc. What I have to do then is erect signposts at all the junctions where there are wrong turnings so as to help people past the danger points.

But such signposts are all that philosophy can offer and there is no certainty that they will be noticed or followed correctly. And we should remember that a signpost belongs in the context of a particular problem area. It might be no help at all elsewhere, and should not be treated as dogma. So philosophy offers no truths, no theories, nothing exciting, but mainly reminders of what we all know. This is not a glamorous role, but it is difficult and important. It requires an almost infinite capacity for taking pains (which is one definition of genius) and could have enormous implications for anyone who is drawn to philosophical contemplation or who is misled by bad philosophical theories. This applies not only to professional philosophers but to any people who stray into philosophical confusion, perhaps not even realizing that their problems are philosophical and not, say, scientific.

5. Meaning

Sect. 43 of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations says that: "For a large class of cases--though not for all--in which we employ the word "meaning" it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language."

It is quite clear that here Wittgenstein is not offering the general theory that "meaning is use," as he is sometimes interpreted as doing. The main rival views that Wittgenstein warns against are that the meaning of a word is some object that it names--in which case the meaning of a word could be destroyed, stolen or locked away, which is nonsense--and that the meaning of a word is some psychological feeling--in which case each user of a word could mean something different by it, having a different feeling, and communication would be difficult if not impossible.

Knowing the meaning of a word can involve knowing many things: to what objects the word refers (if any), whether it is slang or not, what part of speech it is, whether it carries overtones, and if so what kind they are, and so on. To know all this, or to know enough to get by, is to know the use. And generally knowing the use means knowing the meaning. Philosophical questions about consciousness, for example, then, should be responded to by looking at the various uses we make of the word "consciousness." Scientific investigations into the brain are not directly relevant to this inquiry (although they might be indirectly relevant if scientific discoveries led us to change our use of such words). The meaning of any word is a matter of what we do with our language, not something hidden inside anyone's mind or brain. This is not an attack on neuroscience. It is merely distinguishing philosophy (which is properly concerned with linguistic or conceptual analysis) from science (which is concerned with discovering facts).

One exception to the meaning-is-use rule of thumb is given in Philosophical Investigations Sect.561, where Wittgenstein says that "the word "is" is used with two different meanings (as the copula and as the sign of equality)" but that its meaning is not its use. That is to say, "is" has not one complex use (including both "Water is clear" and "Water is H2O") and therefore one complex meaning, but two quite distinct uses and meanings. It is an accident that the same word has these two uses. It is not an accident that we use the word "car" to refer to both Fords and Hondas. But what is accidental and what is essential to a concept depends on us, on how we use it.

This is not completely arbitrary, however. Depending on one's environment, one's physical needs and desires, one's emotions, one's sensory capacities, and so on, different concepts will be more natural or useful to one. This is why "forms of life" are so important to Wittgenstein. What matters to you depends on how you live (and vice versa), and this shapes your experience. So if a lion could speak, Wittgenstein says, we would not be able to understand it. We might realize that "roar" meant zebra, or that "roar, roar" meant lame zebra, but we would not understand lion ethics, politics, aesthetic taste, religion, humor and such like, if lions have these things. We could not honestly say "I know what you mean" to a lion. Understanding another involves empathy, which requires the kind of similarity that we just do not have with lions, and that many people do not have with other human beings.

When a person says something what he or she means depends not only on what is said but also on the context in which it is said. Importance, point, meaning are given by the surroundings. Words, gestures, expressions come alive, as it were, only within a language game, a culture, a form of life. If a picture, say, means something then it means so to somebody. Its meaning is not an objective property of the picture in the way that its size and shape are. The same goes of any mental picture. Hence Wittgenstein's remark that "If God had looked into our minds he would not have been able to see there whom we were speaking of." Any internal image would need interpretation. If I interpret my thought as one of Hitler and God sees it as Charlie Chaplin, who is right? Which of the two famous contemporaries of Wittgenstein's I mean shows itself in the way I behave, the things I do and say. It is in this that the use, the meaning, of my thought or mental picture lies. "The arrow points only in the application that a living being makes of it."

6. Rules and Private Language

Without sharing certain attitudes towards the things around us, without sharing a sense of relevance and responding in similar ways, communication would be impossible. It is important, for instance, that nearly all of us agree nearly all the time on what colors things are. Such agreement is part of our concept of color, Wittgenstein suggests. Regularity of the use of such concepts and agreement in their application is part of language, not a logically necessary precondition of it. We cannot separate the life in which there is such agreement from our concept of color. Imagine a different form or way of life and you imagine a different language with different concepts, different rules and a different logic.

This raises the question of the relation between language and forms or ways of life. For instance, could just one person have a language of his or her own? To imagine an individual solitary from birth is scarcely to imagine a form of life at all, but more like just imagining a life- form. Moreover, language involves rules establishing certain linguistic practices. Rules of grammar express the fact that it is our practice to say this (e.g. "half past twelve") and not that (e.g. "half to one"). Agreement is essential to such practices. Could a solitary individual, then, engage in any practice, including linguistic ones? With whom could he or she agree? This is a controversial issue in the interpretation of Wittgenstein. Gordon Baker and P.M.S. Hacker hold that such a solitary man could speak his own language, follow his own rules, and so on, agreeing, over time, with himself in his judgements and behavior. Orthodoxy is against this interpretation, however.

Norman Malcolm has written that "If you conceive of an individual who has been in solitude his whole life long, then you have cut away the background of instruction, correction, acceptance--in short, the circumstances in which a rule is given, enforced, and followed." Mere regularity of behavior does not constitute following rules, whether they be rules of grammar or any other kind. A car that never starts in cold weather does not follow the rule "Don't start when it's cold," nor does a songbird follow a rule in singing the same song every day. Whether a solitary-from-birth individual would ever do anything that we would properly call following a rule is at least highly doubtful. How could he or she give himself or herself a rule to follow without language? And how could he or she get a language? Inventing one would involve inventing meaning, as Rush Rhees has argued, and this sounds incoherent. (The most famous debate about this was between Rhees and A.J. Ayer. Unfortunately for Wittgenstein, Ayer is generally considered to have won.) Alternatively, perhaps the Crusoe-like figure just does behave, sound, etc. just like a native speaker of, say, English. But this is to imagine either a freakish automaton, not a human being, or else a miracle. In the case of a miracle, Wittgenstein says, it is significant that we imagine not just the pseudo- Crusoe but also God. In the case of the automatic speaker, we might adopt what Daniel Dennett calls an "intentional stance" towards him, calling what he does "speaking English," but he is obviously not doing what the rest of us English-speakers--who learned the language, rather than being born speaking it, and who influence and are influenced by others in our use of the language--do.

The debate about solitary individuals is sometimes referred to as the debate about "private language." Wittgenstein uses this expression in another context, however, to name a language that refers to private sensations. Such a private language by definition cannot be understood by anyone other than its user (who alone knows the sensations to which it refers). Wittgenstein invites us to imagine a man who decides to write 'S' in his diary whenever he has a certain sensation. This sensation has no natural expression, and 'S' cannot be defined in words. The only judge of whether 'S' is used correctly is the inventor of 'S'. The only criterion of correctness is whether a sensation feels the same to him or her. There are no criteria for its being the same other than its seeming the same. So he writes 'S' when he feels like it. He might as well be doodling. The so-called 'private language' is no language at all. The point of this is not to show that a private language is impossible but to show that certain things one might want to say about language are ultimately incoherent. If we really try to picture a world of private objects (sensations) and inner acts of meaning and so on, we see that what we picture is either regular public language or incomprehensible behavior (the man might as well quack as say or write 'S').

This does not, as has been alleged, make Wittgenstein a behaviorist. He does not deny the existence of sensations or experiences. Pains, tickles, itches, etc. are all part of human life, of course. At Philosophical Investigations Sect. 293 Wittgenstein says that "if we construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of 'object and designation' the object drops out of consideration as irrelevant." This suggests not that pains and so on are irrelevant but that we should not construe the grammar of the expression of sensation on the model of 'object and designation'. If we want to understand a concept like pain we should not think of a pain as a private object referred to somehow by the public word "pain." A pain is not "a something," just as love, democracy and strength are not things, but it is no more "a nothing" than they are either (see Philosophical Investigations Sect. 304). Saying this is hardly satisfactory, but there is no simple answer to the question "What is pain?" Wittgenstein offers not an answer but a kind of philosophical 'therapy' intended to clear away what can seem so obscure. To judge the value of this therapy, the reader will just have to read Wittgenstein's work for herself.

The best known work on Wittgenstein's writings on this whole topic is Saul A. Kripke's Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Kripke is struck by the idea that anything might count as continuing a series or following a rule in the same way. It all depends on how the rule or series is interpreted. And any rule for interpretation will itself be subject to a variety of interpretations, and so on. What counts as following a rule correctly, then, is not determined somehow by the rule itself but by what the relevant linguistic community accepts as following the rule. So whether two plus two equals four depends not on some abstract, extra-human rule of addition, but on what we, and especially the people we appoint as experts, accept. Truth conditions are replaced by assertability conditions. To put it crudely, what counts is not what is true or right (in some sense independent of the community of language users), but what you can get away with or get others to accept.

Kripke's theory is clear and ingenious, and owes a lot to Wittgenstein, but is doubtful as an interpretation of Wittgenstein. Kripke himself presents the argument not as Wittgenstein's, nor as his own, but as "Wittgenstein's argument as it struck Kripke" (Kripke p.5). That the argument is not Wittgenstein's is suggested by the fact that it is a theory, and Wittgenstein rejected philosophical theories, and by the fact that the argument relies heavily on the first sentence of Philosophical Investigations Sect. 201: "This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule." For Kripke's theory as a reading of Wittgenstein, it is not good that the very next paragraph begins, "It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here..." Still, it is no easy matter to see just where Wittgenstein does diverge from the hybrid person often referred to as 'Kripkenstein'. The key perhaps lies later in the same paragraph, where Wittgenstein writes that "there is a way of grasping a rule which is not an interpretation". Many scholars, notably Baker and Hacker, have gone to great lengths to explain why Kripke is mistaken. Since Kripke is so much easier to understand, one of the best ways into Wittgenstein's philosophy is to study Kripke and his Wittgensteinian critics. At the very least, Kripke introduces his readers well to issues that were of great concern to Wittgenstein and shows their importance.

7. Realism and Anti-Realism

Wittgenstein's place in the debate about philosophical Realism and Anti-Realism is an interesting one. His emphasis on language and human behavior, practices, etc. makes him a prime candidate for Anti-Realism in many people's eyes. He has even been accused of linguistic idealism, the idea that language is the ultimate reality. The laws of physics, say, would by this theory just be laws of language, the rules of the language game of physics. Anti-Realist scepticism of this kind has proved quite popular in the philosophy of science and in theology, as well as more generally in metaphysics and ethics.

On the other hand, there is a school of Wittgensteinian Realism, which is less well known. Wittgenstein's views on religion, for instance, are often compared with those of Simone Weil, who was a Platonist of sorts. Sabina Lovibond argues for a kind of Wittgensteinian Realism in ethics in her Realism and Imagination in Ethics and the influence of Wittgenstein is clear in Raimond Gaita's Good and Evil: An Absolute Conception. However, one should not go too far with the idea of Wittgensteinian Realism. Lovibond, for instance, equates objectivity with intersubjectivity (universal agreement), so her Realism is of a controversial kind.

Both Realism and Anti-Realism, though, are theories, or schools of theories, and Wittgenstein explicitly rejects the advocacy of theories in philosophy. This does not prove that he practiced what he preached, but it should give us pause. It is also worth noting that supporters of Wittgenstein often claim that he was neither a Realist nor an Anti-Realist, at least with regard to metaphysics. There is something straightforwardly unWittgensteinian about the Realist's belief that language/thought can be compared with reality and found to 'agree' with it. The Anti-Realist says that we could not get outside our thought or language (or form of life or language games) to compare the two. But Wittgenstein was concerned not with what we can or cannot do, but with what makes sense. If metaphysical Realism is incoherent then so is its opposite. The nonsensical utterance "laubgefraub" is not to be contradicted by saying, "No, it is not the case that laubgefraub," or "Laubgefraub is a logical impossibility." If Realism is truly incoherent, as Wittgenstein would say, then so is Anti-Realism.

8. Certainty

Wittgenstein's last writings were on the subject of certainty. He wrote in response to G.E. Moore's attack on scepticism about the external world. Moore had held up one hand, said "Here is one hand," then held up his other hand and said "and here is another." His point was that things outside the mind really do exist, we know they do, and that no grounds for scepticism could be strong enough to undermine this commonsense knowledge.

Wittgenstein did not defend scepticism, but questioned Moore's claim to know that he had two hands. Such 'knowledge' is not something that one is ever taught, or finds out, or proves. It is more like a background against which we come to know other things. Wittgenstein compares this background to the bed of a river. This river bed provides the support, the context, in which claims to know various things have meaning. The bed itself is not something we can know or doubt. In normal circumstances no sane person doubts how many hands he or she has. But unusual circumstances can occur and what was part of the river bed can shift and become part of the river. I might, for instance, wake up dazed after a terrible accident and wonder whether my hands, which I cannot feel, are still there or not. This is quite different, though, from Descartes's pretended doubt as to whether he has a body at all. Such radical doubt is really not doubt at all, from Wittgenstein's point of view. And so it cannot be dispelled by a proof that the body exists, as Moore tried to do.

9. Continuity

Wittgenstein is generally considered to have changed his thinking considerably over his philosophical career. His early work culminated in the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus with its picture theory of language and mysticism, according to this view. Then there came a transitional middle period when he first returned to philosophical work after realizing that he had not solved all the problems of philosophy. This period led to his mature, later period which gave us the Philosophical Investigations and On Certainty.

There certainly are marked changes in Wittgenstein's work, but the differences between his early and late work can be exaggerated. Two central discontinuities in his work are these: whereas the Tractatus is concerned with the general form of the proposition, the general nature of metaphysics, and so on, in his later work Wittgenstein is very critical of "the craving for generality"; and, in the Tractatus Wittgenstein speaks of the central problems of philosophy, whereas the later work treats no problems as central. Another obvious difference is in Wittgenstein's style. The Tractatus is a carefully constructed set of short propositions. The Investigations, though also consisting of numbered sections, is longer, less clearly organized and more rambling, at least in appearance. This reflects Wittgenstein's rejection of the idea that there are just a few central problems in philosophy, and his insistence on paying attention to particular cases, going over the rough ground.

On the other hand, the Tractatus itself says that its propositions are nonsense and thus, in a sense (not easy to understand), rejects itself. The fact that the later work also criticizes the Tractatus is not, therefore, proof of discontinuity in Wittgenstein's work. The main change may have been one of method and style. Problems are investigated one at a time, although many overlap. There is not a full-frontal assault on the problem or problems of philosophy. Otherwise, the Tractatus and the Philosophical Investigations attack much the same problems; they just do so in different ways.

10. Wittgenstein in History

Wittgenstein's place in the history of philosophy is a peculiar one. His philosophical education was unconventional (going from engineering to working first-hand with one of the greatest philosophers of his day in Bertrand Russell) and he seems never to have felt the need to go back and make a thorough study of the history of philosophy. He was interested in Plato, admired Leibniz, but was most influenced by the work of Schopenhauer, Russell and Frege.

From Schopenhauer (perhaps) Wittgenstein got his interest in solipsism and in the ethical nature of the relation between the will and the world. Schopenhauer's saying that "The world is my idea," (from The World as Will and Idea) is echoed in such remarks as "The world is my world" (from Tractatus 5.62). What Wittgenstein means here, where he also says that what the solipsist means is quite correct, but that it cannot be said, is obscure and controversial. Some have taken him to mean that solipsism is true but for some reason cannot be expressed. H.O. Mounce, in his valuable Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction, says that this interpretation is surely wrong. Mounce's view is that Wittgenstein holds solipsism itself to be a confusion, but one that sometimes arises when one tries to express the fact that "I have a point of view on the world which is without neighbours." (Mounce p.91) Wittgenstein was not a solipsist but he remained interested in solipsism and related problems of scepticism throughout his life.

Frege was a mathematician as well as a logician. He was interested in questions of truth and falsehood, sense and reference (a distinction he made famous) and in the relation between objects and concepts, propositions and thoughts. But his interest was in logic and mathematics exclusively, not in psychology or ethics. His great contribution to logic was to introduce various mathematical elements into formal logic, including quantification, functions, arguments (in the mathematical sense of something substituted for a variable in a function) and the value of a function. In logic this value, according to Frege, is always either the True or the False, hence the notion of truth-value. Both Frege and Russell wanted to show that mathematics is an extension of logic. Undoubtedly both men influenced Wittgenstein enormously, especially since he worked first-hand with Russell. Some measure of their importance to him can be seen in the preface to the Tractatus, where Wittgenstein says that he is "indebted to Frege's great works and to the writings of my friend Mr Bertrand Russell for much of the stimulation of my thoughts." For some insight into whether Frege or Russell had the greater influence one can consider whether one would rather be recognized for his or her great works or for simply being a friend.

In turn Wittgenstein influenced twentieth century philosophy enormously. The Vienna Circle logical positivists were greatly impressed by what they found in the Tractatus, especially the idea that logic and mathematics are analytic, the verifiability principle and the idea that philosophy is an activity aimed at clarification, not the discovery of facts. Wittgenstein, though, said that it was what is not in the Tractatus that matters most.

The other group of philosophers most obviously indebted to Wittgenstein is the ordinary language or Oxford school of thought. These thinkers were more interested in Wittgenstein's later work and its attention to grammar.

Wittgenstein is thus a doubly key figure in the development and history of analytic philosophy, but he has become rather unfashionable because of his anti-theoretical, anti-scientism stance, because of the difficulty of his work, and perhaps also because he has been little understood. Similarities between Wittgenstein's work and that of Derrida are now generating interest among continental philosophers, and Wittgenstein may yet prove to be a driving force behind the emerging post-analytic school of philosophy.

11. References and Further Reading

A full bibliographical guide to works by and on Wittgenstein would fill a whole book, namely Wittgenstein: A Bibliographical Guide by Guido Frongia and Brian McGuinness (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1990). Obviously this is already out of date. Instead of a complete guide, therefore, what follows is a list of some of Wittgenstein's main works, some of the best secondary material on his work, and a few other works chosen for their accessibility and entertainment value, for want of a better expression.

a. Wittgenstein's Main Works

  • Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, translated by D.F. Pears and B.F. McGuinness (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1961).
    • His early classic.
  • The Blue and Brown Books, (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1969).
    • From his middle period, these are preliminary studies for his later work.
  • Philosophical Investigations, translated by G.E.M. Anscombe (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1963).
    • His late classic.
  • On Certainty, edited by G.E.M. Anscombe and G.H. von Wright, translated by Denis Paul and G.E.M. Anscombe (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1979).
    • Like many of Wittgenstein's works, this was compiled after his death from notes he had made. In this case the notes come from the last year and a half of his life.Works of more general interest by Wittgenstein include these:
  • Culture and Value, translated by Peter Winch (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1980).
    • These are notes from throughout Wittgenstein's life dealing with all kinds of topics hinted at by its title, including music, literature, philosophy, religion and the value of silliness.
  • Lectures and Conversations on Aesthetics, Psychology and Religious Belief, edited by Cyril Barrett (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1966).
    • For 'psychology' read 'Freud', otherwise the title is explanation enough. Hilary Putnam has recommended the section on religion as a valuable introduction to Wittgenstein's philosophy as a whole.

b. Some Biographies of Wittgenstein

  • Ray Monk Ludwig Wittgenstein: The Duty of Genius (Jonathan Cape, London 1990).
    • Full of enlightening detail.
  • Norman Malcolm Ludwig Wittgenstein: A Memoir (Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York 1984).
    • Shorter and includes material from G.H. von Wright as well. Two of the best books on the Tractatus are:
  • G.E.M. Anscombe An Introduction to Wittgenstein's Tractatus (University of Pennsylvania Press, Philadelphia 1971).
    • Emphasizes the importance of Frege and is notoriously difficult
  • H.O. Mounce Wittgenstein's Tractatus: An Introduction (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1981).
    • Lighter but more reader-friendly.

c. Secondary Works

A good rule of thumb for picking secondary material on Wittgenstein is to trust Wittgenstein's own judgement. He chose G.E.M. Anscombe, Rush Rhees and G.H. von Wright to understand and deal with his unpublished writings after his death. Anything by one of these people should be fairly reliable. More contentiously, I would say that the best people writing on Wittgenstein today are James Conant and Cora Diamond. Other books referred to in the text above or of special note are these:

  • O.K. Bouwsma Wittgenstein: Conversations 1949-1951, edited by J.L. Craft and Ronald E. Hustwit (Hackett, Indianapolis 1986).
    • A seemingly little read slim volume that includes records of Wittgenstein's comments on such diverse and interesting topics as Descartes, utilitarianism and the word 'cheeseburger'.
  • Stanley Cavell The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy (Oxford University Press, Oxford and New York 1979).
    • A long, rich, challenging classic.
  • Cora Diamond The Realistic Spirit: Wittgenstein, Philosophy, and the Mind (MIT, Cambridge, Massachusetts 1991).
    • A collection of essays of varying degrees of accessibility on Frege, Wittgenstein and ethics, united by their Wittgensteinian spirit.
  • M.O'C. Drury The Danger of Words (Thoemmes Press, Bristol, U.K. and Washington, D.C. 1996).
    • A classic, including discussions of issues in psychiatry and religion by a friend of Wittgenstein's.
  • Paul Engelmann Letters from Wittgenstein with a memoir (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1967).
    • Includes discussions by Wittgenstein and his friend Engelmann on the Tractatus, religion, literature and culture.
  • Saul A. Kripke Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language (Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts 1982).
    • See the section on rules and private language above.
  • Norman Malcolm Wittgenstein: Nothing is Hidden (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1986).
    • One of the best accounts of Wittgenstein's philosophy from the disreputable point of view that the Tractatus advanced theses which are then attacked in the later work.
  • Norman Malcolm Wittgenstein: A Religious Point of View?, edited with a response by Peter Winch (Cornell University Press, Ithaca, New York 1994).
    • Malcolm basically summarizes Wittgenstein's philosophy, as he understands it, with a special emphasis on religion. Winch then responds, correcting Malcolm's account where necessary. The result is a highly accessible composite overview of Wittgenstein's work from the religious point of view, which is how Wittgenstein himself said that he saw every problem.

Author Information

Duncan J. Richter
Virginia Military Institute
U. S. A.

Virtue Epistemology

Virtue epistemology is a collection of recent approaches to epistemology that give epistemic or intellectual virtue concepts an important and fundamental role. Virtue epistemologists can be divided into two groups. Virtue reliabilists conceive of intellectual virtues as stable and reliable cognitive faculties or powers and cite vision, introspection, memory, and the like as paradigm cases of intellectual virtue. These virtue epistemologists tend to focus on formulating virtue-based accounts of knowledge or justification. Virtue responsibilists conceive of intellectual virtues as good intellectual character traits, traits like attentiveness, fair-mindedness, open-mindedness, intellectual tenacity, and courage. While some virtue responsibilists have also attempted to give virtue-based accounts of knowledge or justification, others have pursued less traditional projects, focusing on such issues as the nature and value of virtuous intellectual character as such, the relation between intellectual virtue and epistemic responsibility, and the relevance of intellectual virtue to the social and cross-temporal aspects of the intellectual life.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction to Virtue Epistemology
  2. Virtue Reliabilism
    1. Key Figures
    2. Prospects for Virtue Reliabilism
  3. Virtue Responsibilism
    1. Key Figures
    2. Prospects for Virtue Responsibilism
  4. The Reliabilist/Responsibilist Divide
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction to Virtue Epistemology

Virtue epistemology is a collection of recent approaches to epistemology that give epistemic or intellectual virtue concepts an important and fundamental role.

The advent of virtue epistemology was at least partly inspired by a fairly recent renewal of interest in virtue concepts among moral philosophers (see, e.g., Crisp and Slote 1997). Noting this influence from ethics, Ernest Sosa introduced the notion of an intellectual virtue into contemporary epistemological discussion in a 1980 paper, "The Raft and the Pyramid." Sosa argued in this paper that an appeal to intellectual virtue could resolve the conflict between foundationalists and coherentists over the structure of epistemic justification. Since the publication of Sosa's paper nearly 25 years ago, several epistemologists have turned to intellectual virtue concepts to address a wide range of issues, from the Gettier problem to the internalism/externalism debate to skepticism.

There are substantial and complicated differences between the various virtue epistemological views; as a result, relatively little can be said by way of generalization about the central tenets of virtue epistemology. These differences are attributable mainly to two competing conceptions of the nature of an intellectual virtue. Sosa and certain other virtue epistemologists tend to define an intellectual virtue as roughly any stable and reliable or truth-conducive property of a person. They cite as paradigm instances of intellectual virtue certain cognitive faculties or powers like vision, memory, and introspection, since such faculties ordinarily are especially helpful for getting to the truth. Epistemologists with this conception of intellectual virtue have mainly been concerned with constructing virtue-based analyses of knowledge and/or justification. Several have argued, for instance, that knowledge should be understood roughly as true belief arising from an exercise of intellectual virtue. Because of their close resemblance to standard reliabilist epistemologies, these views are referred to as instances of "virtue reliabilism."

A second group of virtue epistemologists conceives of intellectual virtues, not as cognitive faculties or abilities like memory and vision, but rather as good intellectual character traits, traits like inquisitiveness, fair-mindedness, open-mindedness, intellectual carefulness, thoroughness, and tenacity. These character-based versions of virtue epistemology are referred to as instances of "virtue responsibilism," since the traits they regard as intellectual virtues might also be viewed as the traits of a responsible knower or inquirer. Some virtue responsibilists have adopted an approach similar to that of virtue reliabilists by giving virtue concepts a crucial role in an analysis of knowledge or justification. Linda Zagzebski, for instance, claims that knowledge is belief arising from what she calls “acts of intellectual virtue” (1996). Other virtue responsibilists like Lorraine Code (1987) have eschewed more traditional epistemological problems. Code argues that epistemology should be oriented on the notion of epistemic responsibility and that epistemic responsibility is the chief intellectual virtue; however, she makes no attempt to offer a definition of knowledge or justification based on these concepts. Her view instead gives priority to topics like the value of virtuous cognitive character as such, the social and moral dimensions of the intellectual life, and the role of agency in inquiry.

Virtue reliabilists and virtue responsibilists alike have claimed to have the more accurate view of intellectual virtue and hence of the general form that a virtue-based epistemology should take. And both have appealed to Aristotle, one of the first philosophers to employ the notion of an intellectual virtue, in support of their claims. Some virtue responsibilists (e.g., Zagzebski 1996) have argued that the character traits of interest to them are the intellectual counterpart to what Aristotle and other moral philosophers have regarded as the moral virtues and that these traits are therefore properly regarded as intellectual virtues. In response, virtue reliabilists have pointed out that, whatever his conception of moral virtue, Aristotle apparently conceived of intellectual virtues more as truth-conducive cognitive powers or faculties than as good intellectual character traits. They have claimed furthermore that these powers, but not the responsibilist's character traits, have an important role to play in an analysis of knowledge, and that consequently, the former are more reasonably regarded as intellectual virtues (Greco 2000).

It would be a mistake, however, to view either group of virtue epistemologists as necessarily having a weightier claim than the other to the concept of an intellectual virtue, for both are concerned with traits that are genuine and important intellectual excellences and therefore can reasonably be regarded as intellectual virtues. Virtue reliabilists are interested in cognitive qualities that are an effective means to epistemic values like truth and understanding. The traits of interest to virtue responsibilists are also a means to these values, since a person who is, say, reflective, fair-minded, perseverant, intellectually careful, and thorough ordinarily is more likely than one who lacks these qualities to believe what is true, to achieve an understanding of complex phenomena, etc. Moreover, these qualities are "personal excellences" in the sense that one is also a better person (albeit in a distinctively intellectual rather than straightforwardly moral way) as a result of possessing them, that is, as a result of being reflective, fair-minded, intellectually courageous, tenacious, and so forth. The latter is not true of cognitive faculties or abilities like vision or memory. These traits, while contributing importantly to one's overall intellectual well-being, do not make their possessor a better person in any relevant sense. This is entirely consistent, however, with the more general point that virtue responsibilists and virtue reliabilists alike are concerned with genuine and important intellectual excellences both sets of which can reasonably be regarded as intellectual virtues. Virtue reliabilists are concerned with traits that are a critical means to intellectual well-being or “flourishing” and virtue responsibilists with traits that are both a means to and are partly constitutive of intellectual flourishing.

A firmer grasp of the field of virtue epistemology can be achieved by considering, for each branch of virtue epistemology, how some of its main proponents have conceived of the nature of an intellectual virtue and how they have employed virtue concepts in their theories. It will also be helpful to consider the apparent prospects of each kind of virtue epistemology.

2. Virtue Reliabilism

a. Key Figures

Since introducing the notion of an intellectual virtue to contemporary epistemology, Sosa has had more to say than any other virtue epistemologist about the intellectual virtues conceived as reliable cognitive faculties or abilities. Sosa characterizes an intellectual virtue, very generally, as "a quality bound to help maximize one's surplus of truth over error" (1991: 225). Recognizing that any given quality is likely to be helpful for reaching the truth only with respect to a limited field of propositions and only when operating in a certain environment and under certain conditions, Sosa also offers the following more refined characterization: “One has an intellectual virtue or faculty relative to an environment E if and only if one has an inner nature I in virtue of which one would mostly attain the truth and avoid error in a certain field of propositions F, when in certain conditions C” (284). Sosa identifies reason, perception, introspection, and memory as among the qualities that most obviously satisfy these conditions.

Sosa's initial appeal to intellectual virtue in "The Raft and the Pyramid" is aimed specifically at resolving the foundationalist/coherentist dispute over the structure of epistemic justification. (Sosa has since attempted to show that virtue concepts are useful for addressing other epistemological problems as well; the focus here, however, will be limited to his seminal discussion in the “The Raft and the Pyramid.”) According to Sosa, traditional formulations of both foundationalism and coherentism have fatal defects. The main problem with coherentism, he argues, is that it fails to give adequate epistemic weight to experience. The coherentist claims roughly that a belief is justified just in case it coheres with the rest of what one believes. But it is possible for a belief to satisfy this condition and yet be disconnected from or even to conflict with one’s experience. In such cases, the belief in question intuitively is unjustified, thereby indicating the inadequacy of the coherentist’s criterion for justification (1991: 184-85). Sosa also sees standard foundationalist accounts of justification as seriously flawed. The foundationalist holds that the justification of nonbasic beliefs derives from that of basic or foundational beliefs and that the latter are justified on the basis of things like sensory experience, memory, and rational insight. According to Sosa, an adequate version of foundationalism must explain the apparent unity of the various foundationalist principles that connect the ultimate sources of justification with the beliefs they justify. But traditional versions of foundationalism, Sosa claims, seem utterly incapable of providing such an explanation, especially when the possibility of creatures with radically different perceptual or cognitive mechanisms than our own (and hence of radically different epistemic principles) is taken into account (187-89).

Sosa briefly sketches a model of epistemic justification that he says would provide the required kind of explanation. This model depicts justification as "stratified": it attaches primary justification to intellectual virtues like sensory experience and memory and secondary justification to beliefs produced by these virtues. A belief is justified, according to the model, just in case it is has its source in an intellectual virtue (189). Sosa's proposed view of justification is, in effect, an externalist version of foundationalism, since a belief can have its source in an intellectual virtue and hence be justified without this fact’s being internally or subjectively accessible to the person who holds it. This model provides an explanation of the unity of foundationalist epistemic principles by incorporating the foundationalist sources of epistemic justification under the concept of an intellectual virtue and offering a unified account of why beliefs grounded in intellectual virtue are justified (namely, because they are likely to be true). If Sosa’s criticisms of traditional coherentist and foundationalist views together with his own positive proposal are plausible, virtue reliabilism apparently has the resources to deal effectively with one of the more challenging and longstanding problems in contemporary epistemology.

John Greco also gives the intellectual virtues conceived as reliable cognitive faculties or abilities a central epistemological role. Greco characterizes intellectual virtues generally as "broad cognitive abilities or powers" that are helpful for reaching the truth. He claims, more specifically, that intellectual virtues are “innate faculties or acquired habits that enable a person to arrive at truth and avoid error in some relevant field.” These include things like “perception, reliable memory, and various kinds of good reasoning” (2002: 287).

Greco offers an account of knowledge according to which one knows a given proposition just in case one believes the truth regarding that proposition because one believes out of an intellectual virtue (311). This definition is broken down by Greco as follows. It requires, first, that one be subjectively justified in believing the relevant claim. According to Greco, one is subjectively justified in believing a given proposition just in case this belief is produced by dispositions that one manifests when one is motivated to believe what it is true. Greco stipulates that an exercise of intellectual virtue entails the manifestation of such dispositions. Second, Greco's definition of knowledge requires that one’s belief be objectively justified. This means that one’s belief must be produced by one or more of one’s intellectual virtues. Third, Greco’s definition requires that one believe the truth regarding the claim in question because one believes the claim out of one or more of one’s intellectual virtues. In other words, one’s being objectively justified must be a necessary and salient part of the explanation for why one believes the truth.

Greco discusses several alleged virtues of his account of knowledge. One of these is the reply it offers to the skeptic. According to one variety of skepticism, we do not and cannot have any non-question-begging reasons for thinking that any of our beliefs about the external world are true, for any such reasons inevitably depend for their force on some of the very beliefs in question (305-06). Greco replies by claiming that the skeptic's reasoning presupposes a mistaken view of the relation between knowledge and epistemic grounds or reasons. The skeptic assumes that to know a given claim, one must be in possession of grounds or reasons which, via some inductive, deductive, or other logical or quasi-logical principle, provide one with a cogent reason for thinking that the claim is true or likely to be true. If Greco’s account of knowledge is correct, this mischaracterizes the conditions for knowledge. Greco’s account requires merely that an agent’s grounds be reliable, or rather, that an agent herself be reliable on account of a disposition to believe on reliable grounds. It follows that as long as a disposition to form beliefs about the external world on the basis of sensory experience of that world is reliable, knowledge of the external world is possible for a person who possesses this disposition. But since an agent can be so disposed and yet lack grounds for her belief that satisfy the skeptic’s more stringent demands, Greco can conclude that knowledge does not require the satisfaction of these demands (307).

b. Prospects for Virtue Reliabilism

The foregoing indicates some of the ways that virtue reliabilist accounts of knowledge and justification may, if headed in the right general direction, provide helpful ways of addressing some of the more challenging problems in epistemology. It remains, however, that one is likely to find these views plausible only to the extent that one is already convinced of a certain, not wholly uncontroversial position that undergirds and partly motivates them.

Virtue reliabilist accounts of knowledge and justification are versions of epistemological externalism: they deny that the factors grounding one's justification must be cognitively accessible from one’s first-person or internal perspective. Consequently, whatever their strengths as versions of externalism, virtue reliabilist views are likely to prove unsatisfying to anyone with considerable internalist sympathies. Consider, for example, a version of internalism according to which one is justified in believing a given claim just in case one has an adequate reason for thinking that the claim is true. It is not difficult to see why, if this account of justification were correct, the virtue reliabilist views considered above would be less promising than they might initially appear.

Sosa, for instance, attempts to resolve the conflict between foundationalism and coherentism by offering an externalist version of foundationalism. But traditionally, the coherentist/foundationalist debate has been an in-house debate among internalists. Coherentists and foundationalists alike have generally agreed that to be justified in believing a given claim is to have a good reason for thinking that the claim is true. The disagreement has been over the logical structure of such a reason, with coherentists claiming that the structure should be characterized in terms of doxastic coherence relations and foundationalists that it should be characterized mainly in terms of relations between foundational beliefs and the beliefs they support. Sosa rejects this shared assumption. He claims that justification consists in a belief's having its source in an intellectual virtue. But a belief can have its source in an intellectual virtue without one’s being aware of it and hence without one’s having any reason at all for thinking that the belief is true. Therefore, Sosa’s response to the coherentism/foundationalism debate is likely to strike traditional coherentists and foundationalists as seriously problematic.

(It is worth noting in passing that in later work [e.g. 1991], Sosa claims that the kind of justification just described is sufficient, when combined with the other elements of knowledge, merely for "animal knowledge" and not for “reflective” or “human knowledge.” The latter requires the possession of an “epistemic perspective” on any known proposition. While Sosa is not entirely clear on the matter, this apparently requires the satisfaction of something like either traditional coherentist or traditional foundationalist conditions for justification [see, e.g., BonJour 1995].)

An internalist is likely to have a similar reaction to Greco's response to the skeptic. Greco argues against skepticism about the external world by claiming that if a disposition to reason from the appearance of an external world to the existence of that world is in fact reliable then knowledge of the external world is possible for a person who possesses such a disposition. But this view allows for knowledge of the external world in certain cases where a person lacks any cogent or even merely non-question-begging reasons for thinking that the external world exists. As a result, Greco’s more lenient requirements for knowledge are likely to seem to internalists more like a capitulation to rather than a victory over skepticism.

Of course these considerations do not by themselves show virtue reliabilism to be implausible, as the internalist viewpoint in question is itself a matter of some controversy. Indeed, Sosa and Greco alike have argued vigorously against internalism and have lobbied for externalism as the only way out of the skeptical bog. But the debate between internalists and externalists remains a live one and the foregoing indicates that the promise of virtue reliabilism hangs in a deep and important way on the outcome of this debate.

3. Virtue Responsibilism

a. Key Figures

Virtue responsibilism contrasts with virtue reliabilism in at least two important ways. First, virtue responsibilists think of intellectual virtues, not as cognitive faculties like introspection and memory, but rather as traits of character like attentiveness, intellectual courage, carefulness, and thoroughness. Second, while virtue reliabilists tend to focus on the task of providing a virtue-based account of knowledge or justification, several virtue responsibilists have seen fit to pursue different and fairly untraditional epistemological projects.

One of the first contemporary philosophers to discuss the epistemological role of the intellectual virtues conceived as character traits is Lorraine Code (1987). Code claims that epistemologists should pay considerably more attention to the personal, active, and social dimensions of the cognitive life and she attempts to motivate and outline an approach to epistemology that does just this. The central focus of her approach is the notion of epistemic responsibility, as an epistemically responsible person is especially likely to succeed in the areas of the cognitive life that Code says deserve priority. Epistemic responsibility, she claims, is the chief intellectual virtue and the virtue "from which other virtues radiate" (44). Some of these other virtues are open-mindedness, intellectual openness, honesty, and integrity. Since Code maintains that epistemic responsibility should be the focus of epistemology and thinks of epistemic responsibility in terms of virtuous intellectual character, she views the intellectual virtues as deserving an important and fundamental role in epistemology.

Code claims that intellectual virtue is fundamentally "a matter of orientation toward the world, toward one's knowledge-seeking self, and toward other such selves as part of the world" (20). This orientation is partly constituted by what she calls “normative realism”: “[I]t is helpful to think of intellectual goodness as having a realist orientation. It is only those who, in their knowing, strive to do justice to the object - to the world they want to know as well as possible – who can aspire to intellectual virtue … Intellectually virtuous persons value knowing and understanding how things really are” (59). To be intellectually virtuous on Code’s view is thus to regard reality as genuinely intellectually penetrable; it is to regard ourselves and others as having the ability to know and understand the world as it really is. It is also to view such knowledge as an important good, as worth having and pursuing.

Code also claims that the structure of the intellectual virtues and their role in the intellectual life are such that an adequate conception of these things is unlikely to be achieved via the standard methodologies of contemporary epistemology. She claims that an accurate and illuminating account of the intellectual virtues and their cognitive significance must draw on the resources of fiction (201) and often must be content with accurate generalizations rather than airtight technical definitions (254).

Because of its uniqueness on points of both content and method, Code's suggested approach to epistemology is relatively unconcerned with traditional epistemological problems. But she sees this as an advantage. She believes that the scope of traditional epistemology is too narrow and that it overemphasizes the importance of analyzing abstract doxastic properties (e.g., knowledge and justification) (253-54). Her view focuses alternatively on cognitive character in its own right, the role of choice in intellectual flourishing, the relation between moral and epistemic normativity, and the social and communal dimensions of the intellectual life. The result, she claims, is a more rich and "human" approach to epistemology.

A second contemporary philosopher to give considerable attention to the intellectual virtues understood as character traits is James Montmarquet. Montmarquet's interest in these traits arises from a prior concern with moral responsibility (1993). He thinks that to make sense of certain instances moral responsibility, an appeal must be made to a virtue-based conception of doxastic responsibility.

According to Montmarquet, the chief intellectual virtue is epistemic conscientiousness, which he characterizes as a desire to achieve the proper ends of the intellectual life, especially the desire for truth and the avoidance of error (21). Montmarquet's "epistemic conscientiousness" bears a close resemblance to Code’s “epistemic responsibility.” But Montmarquet is quick to point out that a desire for truth is not sufficient for being fully intellectually virtuous and indeed is compatible with the possession of vices like intellectual dogmatism or fanaticism. He therefore supplements his account with three additional kinds of virtues that regulate this desire. The first are virtues of impartiality, which include “an openness to the ideas of others, the willingness to exchange ideas with and learn from them, the lack of jealousy and personal bias directed at their ideas, and the lively sense of one’s own infallibility.” A second set of virtues are those of intellectual sobriety: “These are the virtues of the sober-minded inquirer, as opposed to the ‘enthusiast’ who is disposed, out of sheer love of truth, discovery, and the excitement of new and unfamiliar ideas, to embrace what is not really warranted, even relative to the limits of his own evidence.” Finally, there are virtues of intellectual courage, which include “the willingness to conceive and examine alternatives to popularly held beliefs, perseverance in the face of opposition from others (until one is convinced that one is mistaken), and the determination required to see such a project through to completion” (23).

Montmarquet argues that the status of these traits as virtues cannot adequately be explained on account of their actual reliability or truth-conduciveness. He claims, first, that if we were to learn that, say, owing to the work of a Cartesian demon, the traits we presently regard as intellectual virtues actually lead us away from the truth and the traits we regard as intellectual vices lead us to the truth, we would not immediately revise our judgments about the worth or virtue of those epistemic agents we have known to possess the traits in question (e.g., we would not then regard someone like Galileo as intellectually vicious) (20). Second, he points out that many of those we would regard as more or less equally intellectually virtuous (e.g., Aristotle, Ptolemy, Galileo, Newton, Einstein, etc.) were not equally successful at reaching the truth (21).

Montmarquet goes on to argue that the traits we presently regard as intellectual virtues merit this status because they are qualities that a truth-desiring person would want to have (30). The desire for truth therefore plays an important and basic normative role in Montmarquet's account of intellectual virtue. The value or worth of this desire explains why the traits that emerge from it should be regarded as intellectual virtues.

Unlike Code, Montmarquet does not call for a reorientation of epistemology on the intellectual virtues. His concern is considerably narrower. He is interested mainly in cases in which an agent performs a morally wrong action which from her own point of view is morally justified. In some such cases, the person in question intuitively is morally responsible for her action. But this is possible, Montmarquet argues, only if we can hold the person responsible for the beliefs that permitted the action. He concludes that moral responsibility is sometimes grounded in doxastic responsibility.

Montmarquet appeals to the concept of an intellectual virtue when further clarifying the relevant sense of doxastic responsibility. He claims that in cases of the sort in question, a person can escape moral blame only if the beliefs that license her action are attributable to an exercise of intellectual virtue. Beliefs that satisfy this condition count as epistemically justified in a certain subjective sense (99). Thus on Montmarquet's view, the intellectual virtues are central to an account of doxastic responsibility which in turn is importantly related to the notion of moral responsibility.

Linda Zagzebski's treatment of the intellectual virtues in her book Virtues of the Mind (1996) is one of the most thoroughly and systematically developed in the literature. Zagzebski is unquestionably a virtue responsibilist, as she clearly thinks of intellectual virtues as traits of character. That said, her view bears a notable resemblance to several virtue reliabilist views because its main component is a virtue-based account of knowledge.

Zagzebski begins this account with a detailed and systematic treatment of the structure of a virtue. She says that a virtue, whether moral or intellectual, is "a deep and enduring acquired excellence of a person" (137). She also claims that all virtues have two main components: a motivation component and a success component. Accordingly, to possess an intellectual virtue, a person must be motivated by and reliably successful at achieving certain intellectual ends. These ends are of two sorts (1999: 106). The first are ultimate or final intellectual ends like truth and understanding. Zagzebski's account thus resembles both Code’s and Montmarquet’s, since she also views the intellectual virtues as arising fundamentally from a motivation or desire to achieve certain intellectual goods. The second set of ends consists of proximate or immediate ends that differ from virtue to virtue. The immediate end of intellectual courage, for instance, is to persist in a belief or inquiry in the face of pressure to give it up, while the immediate end of open-mindedness is to genuinely consider the merits of others’ views, even when they conflict with one’s own. Thus, on Zagzebski’s view, an intellectually courageous person, for instance, is motivated to persist in certain beliefs or inquiries out of a desire for truth and is reliably successful at doing so.

Zagzebski claims that knowledge is belief arising from "acts of intellectual virtue." An “act of intellectual virtue” is an act that “gets everything right”: it involves having an intellectually virtuous motive, doing what an intellectually virtuous person would do in the situation, and reaching the truth as a result (1996: 270-71). One performs an act of fair-mindedness, for example, just in case one exhibits the motivational state characteristic of this virtue, does what a fair-minded person would do in the situation, and reaches the truth as a result. Knowledge is acquired when one forms a belief out of one or more acts of this sort.

As this characterization indicates, the justification or warrant condition on Zagzebski's analysis of knowledge entails the truth condition, since part of what it is to perform an act of intellectual virtue is to reach the truth or to form a true belief, and to do so through certain virtuous motives and acts. This explains why Zagzebski characterizes knowledge simply as belief - rather than true belief – arising from acts of intellectual virtue.

Zagzebski claims that this tight connection between the warrant and truth conditions for knowledge makes her analysis immune to Gettier counterexamples (1996: 296-98). She characterizes Gettier cases as situations in which the connection between the warrant condition and truth condition for knowledge is severed by a stroke of bad luck and subsequently restored by a stroke of good luck. Suppose that during the middle of the day I look at the highly reliable clock in my office and find that it reads five minutes past 12. I form the belief that it is five past 12, and this belief is true. Unknown to me, however, the clock unexpectedly stopped exactly 12 hours prior, at 12:05 AM. My belief in this case is true, but only as a result of good luck. And this stroke of good luck cancels out an antecedent stroke of bad luck consisting in the fact that my ordinarily reliable clock has malfunctioned without my knowing it. While my belief is apparently both true and justified, it is not an instance of knowledge.

Zagzebski's account of knowledge generates the intuitively correct conclusion in this and similar cases. My belief about the time, for instance, fails to satisfy her conditions for knowledge because what explains my reaching the truth is not any virtuous motive or activity on my part, but rather a stroke of good luck. Thus by making it a necessary condition for knowledge that a person reach the truth through or because of virtuous motives and actions, Zagzebski apparently is able to rule out cases in which a person gets to the truth in the fortuitous manner characteristic of Gettier cases.

b. Prospects for Virtue Responsibilism

Virtue responsibilist views clearly are a diverse lot. This complicates any account of the apparent prospects of virtue responsibilism, since these prospects are likely to vary from one virtue responsibilist view to another. It does seem fairly clear, however, that as analyses of knowledge or justification, virtue responsibilism faces a formidable difficulty. Any such analysis presumably will make something like an exercise of intellectual virtue a necessary condition either for knowledge or for justification. The problem with such a requirement is that knowledge and justification often are acquired in a more or less passive way, that is, in a way that makes few if any demands on the character of the cognitive agent in question. Suppose, for example, that I am working in my study late at night and the electricity suddenly shuts off, causing all the lights in the room to go out. I will immediately know that the lighting in the room has changed. Yet in acquiring this knowledge, it is extremely unlikely that I exercise any virtuous intellectual character traits; rather, my belief is likely to be produced primarily, if not entirely, by the routine operation of my faculty of vision. Given this and related possibilities, an exercise of intellectual virtue cannot be a necessary condition for knowledge or justification.

This point has obvious implications for a view like Zagzebski's. In the case just noted, I do not exhibit any virtuous intellectual motives. Moreover, while I may not act differently than an intellectually virtuous person would in the circumstances, neither can I be said to act in a way that is characteristic of intellectual virtue. Finally, I get to the truth in this case, not as a result of virtuous motives or actions, but rather as a result of the more or less automatic operation of one of my cognitive faculties. Thus, on several points, my belief fails to satisfy Zagzebski’s requirements for knowledge.

This suggests that any remaining hope for virtue responsibilism must lie with views that do not attempt to offer a virtue-based analysis of knowledge or justification. But such views, which include the views of Code and Montmarquet, also face a serious and rather general challenge. Virtue epistemologists claim that virtue concepts deserve an important and fundamental role in epistemology. But once it is acknowledged that these concepts should not play a central role in an analysis of knowledge or justification, it becomes difficult to see how the virtue responsibilist's claim about the epistemological importance of the intellectual virtues can be defended, for it is at best unclear whether there are any other traditional epistemological issues or questions that a consideration of intellectual virtue is likely to shed much light on. It is unclear, for instance, how reflection on the intellectual virtues as understood by virtue responsibilists could shed any significant light on questions about the possible limits or sources of knowledge.

Any viable version of virtue responsibilism must, then, do two things. First, it must show that there is a unified set of substantive philosophical issues and questions to be pursued in connection with the intellectual virtues and their role in the intellectual life. In the absence of such issues and questions, the philosophical significance of the intellectual virtues and the overall plausibility of virtue responsibilism itself remain questionable. Second, if these issues and questions are to form the basis of an alternative approach to epistemology, they must be the proper subject matter of epistemology itself, rather than of ethics or some other related discipline.

The views of Code and Montmarquet appear to falter with respect to either one or the other of these two conditions. Code, for instance, provides a convincing case for the claim that the possession of virtuous intellectual character is crucial to intellectual flourishing, especially when the more personal and social dimensions of intellectual flourishing are taken into account. But she fails to identify anything like a unified set of substantive philosophical issues and questions that might be pursued in connection with these traits. Nor is it obvious from her discussion what such questions and issues might be. This leaves the impression that while Code has identified an important insight about the value of the intellectual virtues, this insight does not have significant theoretical implications and therefore cannot successfully motivate anything like an alternative approach to epistemology.

Montmarquet, on the other hand, does identify several interesting philosophical questions related to intellectual virtue, for example, questions about the connection between moral and doxastic responsibility, the role of intellectual character in the kind of doxastic responsibility relevant to moral responsibility, and doxastic voluntarism as it relates to issues of moral and doxastic responsibility. The problem with Montmarquet's view as a version of virtue responsibilism, however, is that the questions he identifies seem like the proper subject matter of ethics rather than epistemology. While he does offer a virtue-based conception of epistemic justification, he is quick to point out that this conception is not of the sort that typically interests epistemologists, but rather is aimed at illuminating one aspect of moral responsibility (1993: 104). Indeed, taken as an account of epistemic justification in any of the usual senses, Montmarquet’s view is obviously problematic, since it is possible to be justified in any of these senses without satisfying Montmarquet’s conditions, that is, without exercising any virtuous intellectual character traits. (This again is due to the fact that knowledge and justification are sometimes acquired in a more or less passive way.) Montmarquet’s view therefore apparently fails to satisfy the second of the two conditions noted above.

Jonathan Kvanvig (1992) offers a treatment of the intellectual virtues and their role in the intellectual life that comes closer than that of either Code or Montmarquet to showing that there are substantive questions concerning these traits that might reasonably be pursued by an epistemologist. Kvanvig maintains that the intellectual virtues should be the focus of epistemological inquiry but that this is impossible given the Cartesian structure and orientation of traditional epistemology. He therefore commends a radically different epistemological perspective, one that places fundamental importance on the social and cross-temporal dimensions of the cognitive life and gives a backseat to questions about the nature and limits of knowledge and justification.

While the majority of Kvanvig's discussion is devoted to showing that the traditional framework of epistemology leaves little room for considerations of intellectual virtue (and hence that this framework should be abandoned), he does go some way toward sketching a theoretical program motivated by his proposed alternative perspective that allegedly would give the intellectual virtues a central role. One of the main themes of this program concerns how, over the course of a life, "one progresses down the path toward cognitive ideality." Understanding this progression, Kvanvig claims, would require addressing issues related to “social patterns of mimicry and imitation,” cognitive exemplars, and “the importance of training and practice in learning how to search for the truth” (172). Another crucial issue on Kvanvig’s view concerns “accounting for the superiority from an epistemological point of view of certain communities and the bodies of knowledge they generate.” This might involve asking, for instance, “what makes physics better off than, say, astrology; or what makes scientific books, articles, addresses, or lectures somehow more respectable from an epistemological point of view than books, articles, addresses or lectures regarding astrology” (176). Kvanvig maintains that answers to these and related questions will give a crucial role to the intellectual virtues, as he, like Code, thinks that the success of a cognitive agent in the more social and diachronic dimensions of the cognitive life depends crucially on the extent to which the agent embodies these virtues (183).

Kvanvig's discussion along these lines is suggestive and may indeed point in the direction of a plausible and innovative version of virtue responsibilism. But without seeing the issues and questions he touches on developed and addressed in considerably more detail, it is difficult to tell whether they really could support a genuine alternative approach to epistemology and whether the intellectual virtues would really be the main focus of such an approach. It follows that the viability of virtue responsibilism remains at least to some extent an open question. But if virtue responsibilism is viable, this apparently must be on account of approaches that are in the same general vein as Kvanvig’s, that is, approaches that attempt to stake out an area of inquiry regarding the nature and cognitive significance of the intellectual virtues that is at once philosophically substantial as well as the proper subject matter of epistemology.

4. The Reliabilist/Responsibilist Divide

Virtue reliabilists and virtue responsibilists appear to be advocating two fundamentally different and perhaps opposing kinds of epistemology. The former view certain cognitive faculties or powers as central to epistemology and the latter certain traits of intellectual character. The two approaches also sometimes differ about the proper aims or goals of epistemology: virtue reliabilists tend to uphold the importance of traditional epistemological projects like the analysis of knowledge, while some virtue responsibilists give priority to new and different epistemological concerns. The impression of a deep difference between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism is reinforced by at least two additional considerations. First, by defining the notion of intellectual virtue in terms of intellectual character, virtue responsibilists seem to rule out ex hypothesi any significant role in their theories for the cognitive abilities that interest the virtue reliabilist. Second, some supporters of virtue reliabilism have claimed outright that the character traits of interest to the virtue responsibilist have little bearing on the questions that are most central to a virtue reliabilist epistemology (Goldman 1992: 162).

But the divide between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism is not entirely what it seems. Minimally, the two approaches are not always incompatible. A virtue reliabilist, for instance, can hold that relative to questions concerning the nature of knowledge and justification, a faculty-based approach is most promising, while still maintaining that there are interesting and substantive epistemological questions (even if not of the traditional variety) to be pursued in connection with the character traits that interest the virtue responsibilist (see, e.g., Greco 2002).

More importantly, there is a sense in which the very distinction between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism is considerably more sketchy than it initially appears. Virtue reliabilists conceive of intellectual virtues, broadly, as stable and reliable cognitive qualities. In developing their views, they go on to focus more or less exclusively on cognitive faculties or powers like introspection, vision, reason, and the like. To a certain extent, this approach is quite reasonable. After all, the virtue reliabilist is fundamentally concerned with those traits that explain one's ability to get to the truth in a reliable way, and in many cases, all that is required for reaching the truth is the proper functioning of one’s cognitive faculties. For example, to reach the truth about the appearance of one’s immediate surroundings, one need only have good vision. Or to reach the truth about whether one is in pain, one need only be able to introspect. Therefore, as long as virtue reliabilists limit their attention to instances of knowledge like these, a more or less exclusive focus on cognitive faculties and related abilities seems warranted.

But reaching the truth often requires much more than the proper operation of one's cognitive faculties. Indeed, reaching the truth about things that matter most to human beings - e.g., matters of history, science, philosophy, religion, morality, etc. – would seem frequently to depend more, or at least more saliently, on rather different qualities, many of which are excellences of intellectual character. An important scientific discovery, for example, is rarely explainable primarily in terms of a scientist’s good memory, excellent eyesight, or proficiency at drawing valid logical inferences. While these things may play a role in such an explanation, this role is likely to be secondary to the role played by other qualities, for instance, the scientist’s creativity, ingenuity, intellectual adaptability, thoroughness, persistence, courage, and so forth. And many of these are the very traits of interest to the virtue responsibilist.

It appears that since virtue reliabilists are principally interested in those traits that play a critical or salient role in helping a person reach the truth, they cannot reasonably neglect matters of intellectual character. They too should be concerned with better understanding the nature and intellectual significance of the character traits that interest the virtue responsibilist. Indeed, the most plausible version of virtue reliabilism will incorporate many of these traits into its repertoire of virtues and in doing so will go significant lengths toward bridging the gap between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. 1985. Nicomachean Ethics, trans. Terence Irwin (Indianapolis: Hackett).
  • Axtell, Guy. 1997. "Recent Work in Virtue Epistemology," American Philosophical Quarterly 34: 1-27.
  • Axtell, Guy, ed. 2000. Knowledge, Belief, and Character (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield).
  • BonJour, Laurence. 1995. "Sosa on Knowledge, Justification, and ‘Aptness'," Philosophical Studies 78: 207-220. Reprinted in Axtell (2000).
  • Code, Lorraine. 1987. Epistemic Responsibility (Hanover, NH: University Press of New England).
  • Crisp, Roger and Michael Slote, eds. 1997. Virtue Ethics (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • DePaul, Michael and Linda Zagzebski. 2003. Intellectual Virtue: Perspectives from Ethics and Epistemology (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Fairweather, Abrol and Linda Zagzebski. 2001. Virtue Epistemology: Essays on Epistemic Virtue and Responsibility (New York: Oxford UP).
  • Goldman, Alvin. 1992. "Epistemic Folkways and Scientific Epistemology," Liaisons: Philosophy Meets the Cognitive and Social Sciences (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press).
  • Greco, John. 1992. "Virtue Epistemology," A Companion to Epistemology, eds. Jonathan Dancy and Ernest Sosa (Oxford: Blackwell).
  • Greco, John. 1993. "Virtues and Vices of Virtue Epistemology," Canadian Journal of Philosophy 23: 413-32.
  • Greco, John. 1999. "Agent Reliabilism," Philosophical Perspectives 13, Epistemology, ed. James Tomberlin (Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview).
  • Greco, John. 2000. "Two Kinds of Intellectual Virtue," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 60: 179-84.
  • Greco, John. 2002. "Virtues in Epistemology," Oxford Handbook of Epistemology, ed. Paul Moser (New York: Oxford UP).
  • Hookway, Christopher. 1994. "Cognitive Virtues and Epistemic Evaluations," International Journal of Philosophical Studies 2: 211-27.
  • Kvanvig, Jonathan. 1992. The Intellectual Virtues and the Life of the Mind (Savage, MD: Rowman & Littlefield).
  • Montmarquet, James. 1992. "Epistemic Virtue," A Companion to Epistemology, eds. Jonathan Dancy and Ernest Sosa (Oxford: Blackwell).
  • Montmarquet, James. 1993. Epistemic Virtue and Doxastic Responsibility (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield).
  • Plantinga, Alvin. 1993. Warrant and Proper Function (New York: Oxford UP).
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1980. "The Raft and the Pyramid: Coherence versus Foundations in the Theory of Knowledge," Midwest Studies in Philosophy V: 3-25. Reprinted in Sosa (1991).
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1991. Knowledge in Perspective (Cambridge: Cambridge UP).
  • Steup, Matthias. 2001. Knowledge, Truth, and Duty (Oxford: Oxford UP).
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 1996. Virtues of the Mind (Cambridge: Cambridge UP).
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 1998. "Virtue Epistemology," Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. Edward Craig (London: Routledge).
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 1999. "What Is Knowledge?" The Blackwell Guide to Epistemology, eds. John Greco and Ernest Sosa (Oxford: Blackwell).
  • Zagzebski, Linda. 2000. "From Reliabilism to Virtue Epistemology," Axtell (2000).

Author Information

Jason S. Baehr
Loyola Marymount University
U. S. A.