Category Archives: Philosophy of Language

Pejorative Language

Some words can hurt. Slurs, insults, and swears can be highly offensive and derogatory. Some theorists hold that the derogatory capacity of a pejorative word or phrase is best explained by the content it expresses. In opposition to content theories, deflationism denies that there is any specifically derogatory content expressed by pejoratives.

As noun phrases, ‘insult’ and ‘slur’ refer to symbolic vehicles designed by convention to derogate targeted individuals or groups. When used as verb phrases, ‘insult’ and ‘slur’ refer to actions performed by agents (Anderson and Lepore 2013b). Insulting or slurring someone does not require the use of language. Many different kinds of paralinguistic behavior could be used to insult(verb) or slur(verb) a targeted individual. Slamming a door in an interlocutor’s face is one way to insult them. Another way would be to sneer at them. Arguably, one could slur a Jewish person by performing a “Nazi salute” gesture in their presence. This article focuses on the linguistic meaning(s) that pejorative words encode as symbolic vehicles designed by convention to derogate (or harm) their targets.

Furthermore, it is important to delineate the differences between slurring and insulting. The latter is a matter of causing someone to be offended, where offense is a subjective psychological state (Hom 2012, p 397). Slurring, contrastly, does not require offending a target or eliciting any reaction whatsoever. For instance, the word ‘nigger’, used pejoratively at a Ku Klux Klan rally, derogates African Americans even if none are around to be offended by its use.

Table of Contents

  1. Desiderata
    1. Practical Features
    2. Descriptive Features
    3. Embedded Uses
    4. Expressive Autonomy
    5. Appropriation
  2. Content Theories
    1. Pejorative Content as Fregean Coloring
    2. Expressivism
    3. Slurs and Truth-Value Gaps
    4. A Gestural Theory
    5. A Perspectival Theory
    6. Implicature Theories
    7. A Presupposition Theory
    8. Inferentialism
    9. Combinatorial Externalism
  3. A Deflationary Theory
  4. Broader Applications
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Desiderata

This section  focuses on five central features of pejoratives: practical features, descriptive featuresembedded usesexpressive autonomy and appropriation. An explanation of these features is among the desiderata for an adequate theory of pejoratives.

a. Practical Features

There is a family of related practical features exhibited by pejoratives. First, pejoratives have the striking power to influence and motivate listeners. Insults and slurs can be used as tools for promoting destructive ways of thinking about their targets. Calling someone ‘loser’, for example, is a way of soliciting listeners to view them as undesirable, damaged, inferior, and so forth. Racial slurs have the function of propagating racism in a speech community. ‘Nigger’, for example, has the function of normalizing hateful attitudes and harmful discriminatory practices toward various “non-white” groups. Speakers have used the term to derogate African Americans, Black Africans, East Indians, Arabs, and Polynesians (among others). This is not to suggest that the derogation accomplished by means of pejoratives is always highly destructive. In some circumstances, insults like ‘asshole’ can be used to facilitate mild teasing between friends.

Second, some pejoratives tend to make listeners feel sullied. In some cases, merely overhearing a slur is sufficient for making a non-prejudiced listener feel complicit in a speaker’s slurring performance (Camp 2013) (Croom 2011). Third, different pejoratives vary in their levels of intensity (Saka 2007, p 148). For instance, ‘nigger’ is much more derogatory toward Blacks than ‘honky’ is toward Whites. Even different slurs for a particular group can vary in their derogatory intensity (for example, ‘nigger’ is more derogatory than ‘negro’). Further, pejoratives exhibit derogatory variation across time. While ‘negro’ was once used as a neutral classifying term, it is now highly offensive (Hom 2010, p 166). A successful theory of pejoratives will need to account for their various practical features.

b. Descriptive Features

Gibbard (2003) suggests that the notion of a thick ethical concept, due to Williams (1985), can shed light on the meaning of slurs. In comparison with thin ethical concepts (such as right and wrongjust and unjust), thick ethical concepts contain both evaluative and descriptive content. Paradigm examples include cruelcowardly and unchaste. For Williams, terms that express thick ethical concepts not only play a role in prescribing and motivating action; they also purport to describe how things are. To say that a person is cruel, for example, is to say that they bring about suffering, and they are morally wrong for doing so. (For more on the distinction between thick and thin moral terms, see Metaethics.) According to Gibbard,

[r]acial epithets may sometimes work this way: where the local population stems from different far parts of the world, classification by ancestry can be factual and descriptive, but, alas, the terms people use for this are often denigrating. Nonracists can recognize things people say as truths objectionably couched. (2003, p 300)

Although Gibbard’s claim that slurring statements express truths that are “objectionably couched” is controversial, it does seem that slurs classify their respective targets. A speaker who calls an Italian person ‘spic’ does not merely say something offensive and derogatory – said speaker simulateneously makes a factual error in classifying his target incorrectly. Similarly, the insult ‘moron’ appears to both ascribe a low level of intelligence to its targets and evaluate them negatively for it. Additionally, as the following example illustrates, some swear words seem to contain descriptive content:

(1) A:        Tom fucked Jerry for the first time last week.

B:         No, they fucked for the second time last week; the first was two months ago.

Also, consider the following example (Hom 2010, p 170):

(2)        Random fucking is risky behavior.

There appears to be genuine disagreement between A and B in (1) and someone who asserts (2) has surely made a claim capable of being true or false. A successful theory of pejoratives should explain, or explain away, apparent descriptive, truth-conditional features.

c. Embedded Uses

Potts (2007) observes that most pejoratives appear to exhibit nondisplaceability: the use of a pejorative is derogatory even as an embedded term in a larger construction. An indirect report or a conditional sentence are often vehicles of nondisplacibility; direct quotations, however, are excluded. Consider, for example, that Sue has uttered (3) and another speaker attempts to report on her utterance with (4):

(3)        That asshole Steve is on time today.

(4)        Sue said that that asshole Steve is on time today.

As long as the occurrence of ‘asshole’ is not read as implicitly metalinguistic—with a change in intonation or an accompanying gesture indicating that the speaker wishes to distance herself from any negative feelings toward Steve—listeners will interpret the speaker of (4) as making a disparaging remark about Steve, even if the speaker is merely attempting to report on Sue’s utterance.

Like the insult ‘asshole’, the gendered slur ‘bitch’ appears to scope out of indirect reports. Suppose Eric utters (5) and someone tries to report on his utterance with (6):

(5)        A bitch ran for President of the United States in 2008.

(6)        Eric said that a bitch ran for President of the United States in 2008.

It would be difficult to use (6) to give a neutral (non-sexist) report of Eric’s offensive claim. Unless a metalinguistic reading is available for the occurrence of ‘bitch’, anyone who utters (6) in an attempt to report on Eric’s utterance of (5) risks making an offensive claim about women (Anderson and Lepore 2013a, p 29).

Potts claims that one way in which pejoratives are nondisplaceable is that they always tell us about the current utterance situation (2007, p 169-71).  Consider

(7)        That bastard Kresge was late for work yesterday (#But he’s no bastard today, because he was on time)

Despite the fact that ‘bastard’ is within the scope of a tense operator in (7), it would be implausible to read the speaker as claiming that she disliked Kresge only in the past, as the defective parenthetical (indicated by the hash sign) illustrates.

However, not all pejoratives behave the same way when embedded. Consider (8)-(11):

(8)        If Steve doesn’t finish his report by the end of the week, he’s fucked (but I suspect he’ll finish on time.)

(9)        Suppose our new employee, Steve, is a bastard (On the other hand, maybe he’ll be nice)

(10)      Steve is not a bastard (I think he’s a good guy).

(11)      Steve used to be a real fucker in law school (but I like him much better now).

A speaker who utters (8)-(11) need not be said to have made a disparaging claim about Steve. This is because the occurrences of ‘fucked’, ‘bastard’, and ‘fucker’ in (8)-(11) appear to be “narrow-scoping” (Hom 2012, p.387). Thus, at least some embedded uses of pejoratives seem not to commit the speaker to an offensive claim (compare the non-defective parentheticals in these cases with the defective one in (7)).

Slurring words, however, appear to behave differently. As (12) and (13) illustrate, slurs are just as offensive and derogatory when uttered as part of a supposition or embedded in a conditional sentence as when they are used in predicative assertions:

(12)      If the guys standing at the end of my driveway are spics, I’ll tell them to leave (#Fortunately, there is no such thing as a spic, since no one is inferior for being Hispanic)

(13)      Suppose the next job applicant is a nigger. (#Of course that won’t happen, since no one is inferior for being Black.)

Notice the defectiveness of the parentheticals as attempts to cancel the derogatoriness of the preceding sentences.  In general, slurs appear to take wide scope relative to all truth-conditional operators, including negation. Consider the following explicit attempt to reject a racist claim:

(14)      It is not the case that Ben is a kike; he is not Jewish!

(14) fails to undermine the derogatoriness of the slur ‘kike’. Seemingly, the trouble is that it only disavows a derogatory way of thinking about Ben, and so it cannot be used to reject a racist attitude toward Jews in general (Camp 2013). Further, as Saka (2007, p 122) observes, even Tarskian disquotational sentences containing slurs appear to express hostility:

(15)      “Nietzsche was a kraut” is true iff Nietzsche was a kraut.

A successful theory of pejoratives must explain the behavior of embedded pejorative words and phrases, and more specifically, must account for the fact that slurring words and insulting words appear to behave differently within the scope of truth-conditional and intensional operators. A successful theory must also resolve the apparent tension between the putative descriptive features of slurs, and their behavior under embedding.

d. Expressive Autonomy

The expressive power of a pejorative term is autonomous to the extent that it is independent of the attitudes of particular speakers who use the term. Slurring words appear to exhibit derogatory autonomy– their derogatory capacity is independent of the attitudes of speakers who use them (Hom 2008, p426). For instance, a racist who intends to express affection toward Italians by asserting, ‘I love wops; they are my favorite people on Earth’, has still used the slur in a patently offensive manner (Anderson and Lepore 2013a, p33). Likewise, a competent speaker who knows that ‘kike’ is a term of abuse for Jews could not stipulate a non-derogatory meaning by uttering, “What’s wrong with saying that kikes are smart? By ‘kike’, I just mean Jews, and Jews are smart, aren’t they?” (Saka 2007, p 148).

e. Appropriation

Some pejoratives are used systematically to accomplish aims other than those for which they were designed. Appropriation refers to the various systematic ways in which agents repurpose pejorative language.  For certain slurs, the target group takes over the term to transform its meaning to lessen or to eliminate its derogatory force. This is one variety of appropriation known as linguistic reclamation(Brontsema 2004). The term ‘queer’ is a paradigm case. Although ‘queer’ once derogated those who engaged in sexually abnormal behavior, the term ‘queer’ now contains little to no derogatory force as a result of homosexual women and men appropriating the term. Now, non-prejudiced speakers can use the term ‘queer’ in a various contexts. For instance, phrases such as ‘queer studies program’ and ‘queer theory’ do not derogate homosexuals. In contrast, the slur ‘nigger’ -often marked by an alternative spelling ‘nigga’- has been appropriated more exclusively by the target group, and is often used as a means of expressing camaraderie between group members (Saka 2007, p145). Barring a few rare exceptions, targeted speakers can use the term to refer to one another in a non-denigrating way. Appropriated uses of ‘nigger’ are common in comedic performances and satire. The use of ‘nigger’ in a comedy bit designed to mock and criticize racism need not commit the speaker to racist attitudes (Richard 2008, p.12).

Insults are also subject to appropriation. In some contexts, an insult can be used to express something more jocular or affectionate than hateful, such as in the phrase: ‘George is the most lovable bastard I know’. A successful theory of these phenomena need to account for their various appropriated uses.

2. Content Theories

According to content theories, pejorative words are derogatory in virtue of the content they express. This section contains an overview and discussion of several content theories and their merits, followed by standard criticisms.

a. Pejorative Content as Fregean Coloring

For Gottlob Frege, two aspects to the meaning of a term are its reference and its sense. The reference is what the term denotes, while the sense provides instructions for picking out the reference. (For more on this distinction see Gottlob Frege: Language.) Additionally, Frege posited an expressive realm of meaning separate from sense and reference. For Frege, a word’s färbung (often translated as ‘coloring’ or ‘shading’) is constituted by the negative or positive psychological states associated with it that play no role in determining the truth-value of utterances that include it. The terms ‘dog’ and ‘cur’, for example, share the same sense and reference, but the latter has a negative coloring – something like disgust or contempt for the targeted canine (Frege 1892, p.240). Likewise for the neutral term ‘English’ and the slur ‘Limey’, which was once applied exclusively to English sailors, but now targets English people generally:

(16)      Mary is English.

(17)      Mary is a Limey.

For Frege, both (16) and (17) are true just in case Mary is English. However, for most speakers, ‘English’ is neutral in coloring, while ‘Limey’ is associated with negative feelings for English people.

Although the Fregean approach accounts for the descriptive features of pejoratives as well as the behavior of slurs when embedded, most contemporary theorists reject it (see, for example, Hom (2008)). For Frege, “coloring and shading are not objective, and must be evoked by each hearer or reader” (1897, p 155). On his view, a pejorative term’s coloring is not conventional (in any sense of the term); rather, coloring consists only in subjective (non-conventional) associations speakers have with the term. Dummett (1981) diagnoses the problem with positing an essentially subjective realm of meaning: the meaning of a linguistic sign or symbol cannot be in principle subjective, since it is what speakers conveyto listeners. Given the subjective nature of coloring, Fregeans are committed to holding that the derogatory power of slurs is due to subjective associations held by speakers and listeners. As a result, Fregeans will have difficulty accounting for expressive autonomy (Hom 2008, p 421). For instance, Fregeans will have trouble explaining why ‘nigger’ can be just as derogatory in the mouth of a racist as it is when uttered by a non-racist. In reply, Fregeans might offer a dispositional theory of coloring. Consider an analogy with a dispositional theory of color, according to which a thing is yellow, for example, if it disposes normal agents in appropriate conditions to have a qualitative experience of yellow. Similarly, Fregeans might hold that a slur has a negative coloring to the extent that uttering or hearing S disposes speakers and listeners to have derogatory attitudes toward the target. This approach could generalize to other pejorative terms. Consider Frege’s example of ‘cur’. On the revised version of the theory, ‘cur’ has a negative coloring to the extent that competent listeners who hear the term predicated of a dog are disposed to think of the targeted canine as flea-ridden, mangy, and dangerous. Such an account might be promising, but much more would need to be said about how hearing the word disposes listeners to think in derogatory ways. As it stands, the Fregean view does little to explain how pejoratives can be so rhetorically powerful.

b. Expressivism

Another main theory of pejoratives is a descendent of the metaethical view known as expressivism. According to the version of expressivism developed by Ayer (1936), moral and aesthetic statements do not express propositions capable of being true or false, and merely serve to express and endorse the speaker’s own moral sentiments. For Ayer, an assertion of ‘Stealing is wrong’ does not express a truth-evaluable proposition; rather, it merely expresses the speaker’s disapproval of stealing. (For more on expressivism, see Non-Cognitivism in Ethics.)

One might extend Ayer’s expressivism to cover pejoratives. On this view, derogatory statements containing pejoratives do not express propositions capable of being true or false – they merely express a non-cognitive attitude, such as disapproval, of the target group. An expressivist theory of pejoratives is well suited to explain the behavior of slurs under embedding. However, it will have difficulty accounting for their descriptive features. As noted above, a speaker who calls an Italian person ‘spic’ has seemingly made a classificatory error. If slurs lack descriptive content, and merely serve to express non-cognitive attitudes, then it is unclear how they could classify their targets.

Saka (2007) offers an alternative, hybrid expressivist theory of slurs, according to which slurs contain both expressive and descriptive content (see also Kaplan (2004)). Saka denies that there is a single belief or proposition expressed by slurring statements such as ‘Nietzsche was a kraut’. Rather, such statements express an attitude complex, which includes (i) the pure belief that Nietzsche was German, and (ii) a cognitive-affective state toward Germans (Saka 2007, p 143). Saka’s hybrid theory could plausibly account for the descriptive, truth-conditional features of pejoratives.

However, it is not clear that either the pure expressivist theory of pejoratives or Saka’s hybrid theory can extend to all pejoratives. According to a standard objection to metaethical expressivism, the so-called Frege-Geach problem, one can utter a sentence containing a moral predicate (such as ‘good’, ‘evil’, ‘right’, and ‘wrong’) as the antecedent or consequent of a conditional sentence without making a moral judgment. Expressivists about moral terms are unable to account for the sameness of content in both asserted and non-asserted contexts, so the objection goes. For example, as Geach (1965) observed, the following is a valid argument:

(18)      If tormenting the cat is wrong, then getting your brother to do it is wrong.

(19)      Tormenting the cat is wrong.

(20)      Therefore, getting your brother to do it is wrong.

If, as the metaethical expressivist claims, ‘wrong’ merely expresses a speaker’s approval, then it is a mystery how the term ‘wrong’ could carry the same content in (19) and when embedded in the antecedent of the conditional sentence in (18), given that (19) expresses a moral judgment while (18) does not. Hom (2010) argues that expressivist theories of swears face a similar challenge. Consider the following argument:

(21)      If George fucked up his presentation, he will be fired.

(22)      George fucked up his presentation.

(23)      Therefore, he will be fired.

In order for this argument to be valid, the pejorative term ‘fucked’ must have the same semantic content in (21) and (22), despite the fact that (21) does not express a negative attitude about George, while (22) does. It is difficult to see how the pure expressivist theory could account for this. Although Saka’s hybrid theory has the potential to explain the preservation of content between (21) and (22), his view will have difficulty accounting for the fact that (21) expresses no negative attitude about George.

Additionally, one might worry that the non-cognitive attitudes posited by expressivism are too underspecified to account for derogatory variation (‘kraut’ is less derogatory than ‘nigger’ is, and so forth). Do all pejoratives express something like ‘contempt’ or ‘hostility’ or do the negative attitudes differ for each term? Saka claims that derogatory variation among slurs is due to the historical circumstances that led to their introduction and sustain their derogatory power (Saka 2007, p148). But the appeal to historical context here is illicit if the derogatoriness of slurs is to be explained by an attitude complex expressed by speakers who use the term. After appealing to external institutions to explain the derogatory features of slurs, it appears that the posited attitude complex has no remaining explanatory work.

Finally, expressivists need to do more to explain how the expression of negative attitudes relates to the practical features of slurs. In particular, they need to specify a notion of expression that makes it clear how the expression of hostility (or contempt, and so forth) toward a target could motivate listeners to feel similarly.

c. Slurs and Truth-Value Gaps

Richard (2008) holds that slurs express derogatory attitudes toward their targets, but unlike Saka he claims that slurs lack truth-conditional content. Richard is not a pure expressivist, since he does not take the derogatory content of slurs to be a negative affective state. He denies that slurring speech is false by claiming that to apply the term ‘false’ to an utterance is to claim that the speaker made an error that can be corrected by judicious use of negation. Nevertheless, examples like “My neighbor isn’t a chink; she’s Japanese,” suggest that it cannot. Richard also denies that derogatory statements containing slurs can be true. He acknowledges that predicating a slur of someone entails classifying him or her as a member of a particular group, but he denies that correct classification suffices for truth. For instance, Richard holds that the anti-Semite can correctly classify a person as Jewish by calling them ‘kike’, but when a speaker slurs a Jewish person with ‘kike’, they have not simply classified them as Jewish nor have they merely expressed an affective state (like hatred or contempt) – they have misrepresented the target as being despicable for being Jewish. According to Richard, we cannot endorse the classification as true without also endorsing the representation as accurate. On his view, whatever truth belongs to a classification is truth it inherited from the thought expressed in making it, and the thought expressed by the anti-Semite who uses the slur ‘kike’ is the mistaken thought that Jews are despicable for being Jewish (Richard 2008, p. 24).

Although Richard’s view could potentially make sense of the behavior of slurs under embedding, he does not offer a positive theory of how slurs represent their targets. He might hold that the relevant sort of representation is imagistic. Perhaps hearing a slur puts an unflattering image of the target group in the minds of listeners. In any event, Richard offers no help here. Instead, he is interested only in establishing that there are numerous statements – among them, derogatory statements containing slurs – that have a determinate content, yet are not truth-apt. Others include applications of vague predicates to borderline cases and statements that give rise to liar paradoxes. As it stands, nothing in Richard’s view helps us see how misrepresenting a target by means of calling them a pejorative word has the power to motivate listeners to think derogatory thoughts about them. Thus, Richard’s view leaves the practical features of slurs unexplained.

Further, there are reasons to be doubtful of Richard’s claim that slurs always misrepresent their targets. While this claim seems plausible in the case of racial slurs, it is not obviously true of all slurring words. Consider ‘fascist’, which is a slur for officials in an authoritarian political system. On Richard’s view, to call Mussolini and Hitler fascists is to represent them as contemptible for their political affiliation. Presumably, this would not be to misrepresent them. Richard might agree, and respond that the concept of truth is not what we should use when evaluating a slurring performance as accurate or inaccurate. In that case, Richard still owes a positive account of how such words can accurately represent their targets. Absent these details, it is difficult to evaluate Richard’s claims.

d. A Gestural Theory

Hornsby (2001) offers a theory of the derogatory content of slurs, but her view could be extended to cover other pejoratives:

It is as if someone who used, say, the word ‘nigger’ had made a particular gesture while uttering the word’s neutral counterpart. An aspect of the word’s meaning is to be thought of as if it were communicated by means of this (posited) gesture. The gesture is made, ineludibly, in the course of speaking, and is thus to be explicated…in illocutionary terms. (p 140)

According to Hornsby, the gestural content of a slur cannot be captured in terms of a proposition or thought. Rather, “the commitments incurred by someone who makes the gesture are commitments to targeted emotional attitudes” (2001, p140).  Hornsby’s gestural theory has the potential to account for slurs’ expressive autonomy and their offensiveness when embedded. Unfortunately, Hornsby’s central thesis is unclear. On one interpretation, she holds that a speaker who uses a slur actually performs a pejorative gesture in the course of uttering it, although the gesture itself is elliptical. On another interpretation, she is claiming only that using a slur is analogous to performing a derogatory gesture. For either interpretation, there is a lacunae in Hornsby’s theory. If the first interpretation is what Hornsby intends, she owes an account of what the posited gestures are supposed to be. Perhaps she thinks that to call an African American ‘nigger’ is to perform an elliptical “throat slash” in their direction (Hom 2008, p418). Or maybe uttering ‘nigger’ amounts to giving targets “the finger”. If this is what Hornsby intends, she owes an account of how it is possible to perform an elided gesture. On the other hand, if Hornsby is merely claiming that derogatory uses of slurs are analogous to pejorative gestures, she needs to specify how tight the analogy is.

e. A Perspectival Theory

Camp (2013) offers a perspectival theory of slurs. On her view, slurs are so rhetorically powerful because they signal allegiance to a perspective, which is an integrated, intuitive way of thinking about the target group (p335). For Camp, a speaker who slurs some group G non-defeasibly signals his affiliation with a way of thinking and feeling about Gs as a whole (p340). The perspectival account offers an explanation for why slurs produce a feeling of complicity in their hearers, that is, why non-racist listeners tend to feel implicated in a speaker’s slurring performance. Camp describes two kinds of complicity. First, there is cognitive complicity:

The nature of semantic understanding, along with the fact that perspectives are intuitive cognitive structures only partially under conscious control, means that simply hearing a slur activates an associated perspective in the mind of a linguistically and culturally competent hearer. This in turn affects the hearer’s own intuitive patterns of thought: she now thinks about G’s in general, about the specific G (if any) being discussed, and indeed about anyone affiliated with Gs in the slurs’ light, however little she wants to. (p343)

Second, there is social complicity: the fact that there exists a word designed by convention to express the speaker’s perspective indicates that the perspective is widespread in the hearer’s culture, and being reminded of this may be painful for non-prejudiced listeners (Camp 2013, p344; see also Saka 2007, p 142).  Camp’s theory also has the potential to explain linguistic reclamation. When a slur is taken over by its target group and its pejorative meaning is transformed; the derogatory perspective it once signaled becomes detached and the term comes to signal allegiance to a neutral (or positive) perspective on the target.

One might take issue with Camp’s claim that complicity is due to speakers signaling the presence of racist attitudes. In general, merely signaling one’s own perspective is insufficient for generating complicity. For instance, one might signal one’s libertarian political perspective by placing a ‘Ron Paul’ bumper sticker on one’s car, yet this behavior is not likely to make observers feel complicit in the expression of a libertarian perspective. Even signaling one’s racist attitudes need not lead others to feel complicit. For instance, one might overtly signal a racist perspective by refusing to sit next to members of a certain race on a bus or by crossing the street whenever a member of a certain race is walking toward them; however, in most cases, this sort of behavior is not likely to activate a derogatory perspective in observers or make observers feel complicit. Thus, the fact that slurs signal a derogatory perspective, if it is a fact, does not explain why slurs tend to make listeners feel complicit in the expression of a derogatory attitude.

f. Implicature Theories

In some cases, what a speaker means is not exhausted by what she literally says. Grice (1989) distinguishes what a speaker literally says with her words from what she implies or suggests with them. Grice posited two kinds of implicature: conversational and conventional. When a speaker communicates something by means of conversational implicature, she violates (or makes as if to violate) a conversational norm, such as provide as much information as is required given the aim of the conversation. The hearer, working on the assumption that the speaker is being cooperative, attempts to derive the implicatum (that is, what the speaker meant, but did not literally say) based on the words used by the speaker and what conversational norm she has (apparently) violated. Suppose that Professor has written a letter of recommendation for her philosophy student, X, that reads, “Mr. X’s command of English is excellent, and his attendance at tutorials has been regular” (Grice 1989, p 33). The reader, recognizing that A does not wish to opt out, will observe that she has apparently violated the maxim of quantity: seemingly, she has not provided enough information about X’s philosophical abilities for the reader to make an assessment. The most reasonable explanation for A’s behavior is that she thinks X is a rather bad student, but is reluctant to explicitly say so, since doing so would entail saying something impolite or violating some other norm. According to Grice, sometimes the conventional meaning of a term determines what is implied by usage of the word, in addition to determining what is said by it. If a sentence s conventionally implies that Q, then it is possible to find another sentence s*, which is truth-conditionally equivalent to s, yet does not imply that Q. Consider the sentences ‘Alexis is rich and kind’ and ‘Alexis is rich, but kind’. For Grice, these two sentences have the same literal truth-conditions (they are true just in case Alexis is both rich and kind), but only the latter implies that there is a contrast between being rich and kind (in virtue of the conventional meaning of ‘but’). (For more on Grice’s theory of implicature, see Philosophy of Language.)

One might apply Grice’s theory of implicature to pejoratives. A theory that understands pejorative content as conversationally implicated content has little chance of succeeding. First, it seems that the pejorative meaning of a slur needn’t be worked out by the listener in the way that a conversational implicature must be (Saka 2007, p136). Second, conversational implicata are supposed to be cancellable, but the derogatory content of a slur is not (Hom 2008, p434). According to Grice, for any putative conversational implicatureP, it will always be possible to explicitly cancel P by adding something like ‘but not P’ or ‘I do not mean to imply that P’. And it is clear that the derogatory contents of slurs are not explicitly cancellable, as the following defective example illustrates: ‘That house is full of kikes, but I don’t mean to disparage Jewish people’.

Stenner (1981), Whiting (2007, 2013) and Williamson (2009) have argued that the derogatory content of some pejorative words and phrases is best understood in terms of conventional implicature. According to a conventional implicature account of slurs (hereafter, the ‘CI account’), slurs and their neutral counterparts have the same literal meaning, but slurs conventionally imply something negative that their neutral counterparts do not. For instance, ‘Franz was German’ and ‘Franz was a Boche’ are the same at the level of what is said – they have the same literal truth-conditions, that is, they are both true just in case Franz was German. But ‘Franz was a Boche’ conventionally implies the false and derogatory propositionthat Franz was cruel and despicable because he was German. One virtue of the CI account is that it explains the descriptive features of pejoratives as well as expressive autonomy.

One objection to the CI account is that it is controversial whether there is any such thing as conventional implicature. Bach (1999) argues that putative cases of conventional implicature are actually part of what is said by an utterance. Bach devised the indirect quotation (IQ) test for conventionally implicated content. Suppose that speaker A has uttered (24), and speaker B has reported on A’s utterance with (25):

(24)      She is wise, but short.

(25)      A said that she is wise and short.

According to Bach, since B has left out important information in her indirect report, namely information about the purported contrast between being wise and short, that information must have been part of what was said, as opposed to what was implied, by A’s utterance. Hom (2008) uses Bach’s IQ test to undermine the CI account of slurs. Suppose A uttered (26) and reported on A’s utterance with (27):

(26)      Bill is a spic.

(27)      A said that Bill is Hispanic.

According to Hom, since B has misreported A, the derogatory content of the slur must be part of what is said, and so the CI account fails. Notice, however, that Hom’s use of Bach’s test does not show that the derogatoriness of slurs must be part of their literal semantic content, since “what is said” could refer to pragmatically enriched content (see, for example, Bach (1994)).  A more serious objection is that even if Griceans are correct in holding that an utterance of ‘Italians are wops’ carries a negative implicature about Italians, more would need to be said in order to explain how implying something negative about Italians could bring about complicity in listeners, and motivate listeners to discriminate against Italians. Consider a paradigm case of conventional implicature: a speaker who asserts ‘but Q’ commits herself to a contrast between P and Q by virtue of the conventional meaning of ‘but’. However, there is no reason to think that bystanders would automatically feel complicit in the speaker’s claim. Yet listeners often find themselves feeling complicit in the expression of a negative attitude just by overhearing a slur. Even if terms like ‘but’ are capable of triggering a kind of complicity, it is surely not the robust sort of complicity triggered by slurs. Potts (2007) offers a non-propositional version of the CI account. Potts understands pejorative content in terms of expressive indices, which model a speaker’s negative (or positive) attitudes in a conversational context. He offers the following schema for an expressive index:

<a I b>

where and b are individuals, and I is an interval that represents a’s positive or negative feelings for in the conversational context. The more narrow the interval, the more intense the feeling. If I = [-1, 1], then ais essentially indifferent toward b. If I = [0.8, 1], then a has a highly positive attitude toward b. If I = [-0.5, 0], then a has negative feelings for b. For Potts, the conventionally implicated content of a pejorative is a function that alters the expressive index of a conversational context. So, for example, if Bill calls George a ‘spic’, the expressive index might shift from <Bill [-1, 1] George>, where Bill is indifferent to George, to <Bill [-0.5, 0] George>, where Bill has negative feelings toward George. Potts’s theory could potentially account for complicity. He might argue that a feeling of complicity results from taking part in a conversation whose expressive index has been lowered due to the use of a slur. One problem with Potts’s theory is that expressive indices are supposed to measure psychological states of conversation participants, and these can depend on a variety of idiosyncratic features of the participants – their background beliefs, values, and so forth. This makes it difficult to see how the expressive content of pejoratives could be objective and speaker-independent (Hom 2010, p180).

Additionally, Potts’s numerical modeling of attitudes seems too coarse-grained to explain the differences between slurs and other pejoratives. One could shift the expressive index of a conversation by using an insult like ‘asshole’ or even by using non-pejorative language. For instance, Bill might lower the expressive index in a conversation about his colleague, George, by pointing out that George is late for work and that he’s not dressed appropriately for the office. Bill could also lower the index by uttering, ‘Here comes George!’ in a contemptuous tone of voice. If Potts is correct, the pejorative content of slurs like ‘nigger’, ‘chink’, and ‘spic’ should be understood in terms of expressive indices. However, in that case, Potts will have difficulty explaining the distinctively racist nature of these words, which derogate individuals qua members of particular racial groups.

g. A Presupposition Theory

In the philosophical literature, to presuppose a proposition P is to take P for granted in a way that contrasts with asserting that P (Soames 1989, p.553). According to one widely accepted theory, presupposed content is best understood in terms of attitudes and background beliefs of speakers. According to Robert Stalnaker’s theory of pragmatic presupposition, each conversation is governed by a conversational record, which includes the common ground, that is, the background assumptions mutually accepted by participants for the purposes of the conversation. The pragmatic presuppositions of an utterance are the requirements it places on sets of common background assumptions built up among conversational participants (Soames 1989, p.556). Mutually accepted background assumptions are subject to change over the course of a conversation. Lewis (1979) observes that information can be added to (or removed from) the conversational record when necessary in order to forestall presupposition failure and make what is said conversationally acceptable. For instance, if a speaker says, ‘Avery broke the copy machine’ in the course of a conversation, and it was not already mutually understood by the speaker and her listeners that a copy machine was damaged, then it will be assumed for the purposes of the conversation that some salient copy machine was broken. Schlenker (2007) argues that pejorative content is best understood in terms of presupposition. Consider how the presupposition theory covers slurs. Suppose (28) is asked in a conversation:

(28)      Was there a honky on the subway today?

According to Schlenker, if none of the conversation participants dissent, a derogatory proposition (or set of such propositions) – for example, that Caucasians are despicable for being Caucasianthat the speaker and the audience are willing to treat Caucasians as despicable – is incorporated into common ground.

There are several problems with the presupposition theory of pejoratives. First, as Potts (2007), Hom (2010), and Anderson and Lepore (2013a) observe, presuppositions can be cancelled when sentences that trigger them are embedded in an indirect report, but the derogatoriness of embedded slurs cannot be cancelled. Compare (29) with (30):

(29)      Frank believes that John stopped smoking, but John has never smoked.

(30)      #Eric said that a nigger is in the white house, but Blacks are not inferior for being Black.

Ordinarily, an assertion of ‘John stopped smoking’ presupposes that John previously smoked. When embedded in an indirect report, however, the presupposition can be cancelled, as (29) illustrates. In contrast, (30) appears to convey something highly offensive, which cannot be cancelled by the right conjunct. If the presupposition account were correct, we would expect (30) to be inoffensive and non-derogatory. Also, as Richard (2008) has observed, derogation with slurs needn’t be a rational, cooperative effort between speakers. According to Richard,

[a] pretty good rule of thumb is that someone who is using these words is insulting and being hostile to their targets. But there is a rather large gap between doing that and putting something on the conversational record. If I yell ‘Smuck!’ at someone who cuts me off…[a]m I entitled to assume, if you don’t say ‘He’s not a smuck’, that you assume that the person in question is a smuck, or are hostile towards him? Surely not. (2008, pp.21-2)

h. Inferentialism

Inferentialism is the thesis that knowing the meaning of a statement is a matter of knowing the conditions under which one is justified in making the statement; and the consequences of accepting it, which include both the inferential powers of the statement and anything that counts as acting on the truth of the statement (Dummett 1981, p 453). In this view, one knows the meaning of the term ‘valid’, for example, if one knows the criteria for applying ‘valid’ to arguments, and one understanding the consequences of such an application, namely that an argument’s validity provides a basis for accepting its conclusion so long as one accepts its premises.

Dummett (1981) offers an inferentialist account of slurs (see also Tirrell (1999) and Brandom (2000)). Dummett posits two inference rules for slurs: an introduction rule and an elimination rule. The introduction rule gives sufficient conditions for applying the slur to someone and the elimination rule specifies what one commits oneself to by doing so. Consider the slur ‘boche’, which was once commonly applied to people of German origin:

The condition for applying the term to someone is that he is of German nationality; the consequences of its application are that he is barbarous and more prone to cruelty than other Europeans. We should envisage the connections in both directions as sufficiently tight as to be involved in the very meaning of the word: neither could be severed without altering its meaning (454).

Williamson (2009) formalizes Dummett’s inference rules for ‘boche’ as follows:

Boche introduction:

x is a German

Therefore, x is a boche

Boche elimination:

x is a boche

Therefore, x is cruel

Brandom (2000) endorses the inferentialist account of slurs, and notes a sense in which slurs are unsayable for non-prejudiced speakers. On his view, once one uses a term like ‘boche’, one commits oneself to the thought that Germans are cruel because of being German. The only recourse for non-xenophobic speakers, Brandom concludes, is to refuse to employ the concept, since it embodies an inference one does not endorse. The inferentialist theory is well suited to explain the descriptive features of slurs as well as expressive autonomy. The theory also accounts for why a slur is derogatory toward an entire group of individuals, even when a speaker intends only to derogate a single person in a particular context with the term.

However, there are numerous objections to the inferentialist’s treatment of slurs. First, Hornsby (2001) questions whether it is possible to spell out for every slur the consequences to which its users are committed. Further, as Williamson (2009) observes, a speaker might grow up in a community where only the pejorative word for a group is used. For instance, someone may only know Germans as people who are ‘boche’ without knowing the term ‘Germans’. In that case, the speaker could be competent with ‘boche’ (she could know that it is a xenophobic term of abuse) without knowing the word ‘German’. Thus, knowing the ‘boche-introduction’ rule is not necessary for competency with the slur.

i. Combinatorial Externalism

Hom (2008) offers a theory of the semantic content of slurs. According to Hom, the derogatory content of a pejorative term is wholly constituted by its literal meaning. Hom makes use of the semantic externalist framework first developed by Putnam (1975) and Kripke (1980). Semantic externalism holds that the internal state of the particular speaker of a word does not fully determine the word’s meaning, which is instead determined, at least partly, by external social practices of the linguistic community to which the word actively belongs. For more on semantic externalism, see Internalism and Externalism in the Philosophy of Mind and Language. According to Putnam (1975), one can competently use terms like ‘elm’ and ‘beech’ without understanding the complex biological properties of each kind of tree, as long as one stands in the right sort of causal relation to the social institutions that determine their meaning. Similarly, according to Hom, the meaning of a slur is determined by a social institution of racism that is constituted by a racist ideology and a set of harmful discriminatory practices. Hom offers the following formal schema for the semantic content of slurs:

Ought to be subject to p*1 + … + p*n because of being d*1 + … + d*nall because of being NPC*,

where p*1 + … + p*are prescriptions for harmful discriminatory treatment derived from a set of racist practices, d*1 + … + d*are negative properties derived from a racist ideology, and NPC* is the semantic value of the slur’s neutral counterpart (Hom 2008, p.431). Hom calls his view Combinatorial Externalism (CE). On this view, ‘chink’ expresses the following complex, socially constructed property as part of its literal meaning: ought to be subject to higher college admissions standardsexcluded from managerial positions…, because of being slanty-eyed, devious…, all because of being Chinese.

According to Hom, one motivation for CE is that it accounts for the common intuition that slurs have empty extensions. A non-racist might say ‘There are no chinks; there are only Chinese.’ Given that no one ought to be subject to discriminatory practices because of their race, CE predicts that all racial slurs have null extensions. Hom’s semantic analysis also accounts for expressive autonomy, since the social institutions that determine the meanings of slurs are independent of the attitudes of particular speakers. Finally, CE accounts for non-derogatory, appropriated uses of slurs by in-group members. For Hom, when a targeted group appropriates a slur, they create a new supporting social institution for the term which imbues the term with a new (non-pejorative) semantic content.

Hom (2012) extends CE to cover swears. Consider Hom’s analysis of ‘John fucked Mary’:

to say that John fucked Mary is to say (something like) that they each ought to be scorned, ought to go to hell, ought to be treated as less desirable (if female), ought to be treated as more desirable (if male), ought to be treated as damaged (if female), …, for being sinful, unchaste, lustful, impure, … because of having sexual intercourse with each other. (Hom 2012, p 395)

In speech communities wherein ideologies support progressive ideas about sex and reject the meaning of the term, the term will come to have a different semantic content  because the above prescriptions will no longer be a part of the semantic content of ‘fucked’.

CE faces several objections. First, the behavior of embedded slurs poses a problem for CE (see Richard (2008), Jeshion (2013) and Whiting (2013)). According to Hom (2012), derogation requires the actual predication of a slur to a targeted individual. Notice that a speaker who utters (31) has not literally assigned negative properties to anyone or prescribed negative practices for anyone, yet the utterance appears to be highly offensive and derogatory:

(31)      If there are any spics among the job applicants, do not hire them.

If Hom is correct, non-prejudiced speakers should be able to endorse utterances like (31), since they would be true, given their false antecedents (Richard 2008, p17). In response, Hom (2012) suggests that wide-scoping intuitions about pejoratives can be explained by what they conversationally imply. (31)  indicates that the speaker thinks that some Hispanic individuals are inferior and ought to be excluded from employment opportunities. However, if this is correct, there should be contexts where the speaker can felicitously follow up her utterance with ‘not that I mean to imply that Hispanic people are inferior or that they should be discriminated against’, since conversational implicata are cancellable. But the use of the slur in (31) seems non-defeasibly racist and derogatory. As Jeshion (2013) observes, following the utterance up with ‘but I don’t mean to imply anything derogatory’ does not get the speaker off the hook.

Finally, Jeshion (2013) objects that CE’s account of the semantic content of slurs has it backwards. She argues that ideologies and social practices must antedate slurs, and this is a problem because the use of a slur for a particular group often plays a role in the creation and development of such institutions and practices. If so, a social institution could not be the source of a slur’s pejorative content.

3. A Deflationary Theory

Anderson and Lepore (2013a, 2013b) deny that the characteristic features of slurs are due to the contents they express. Their proposal is simply that “slurs are prohibited words; as such, their uses are offensive to whomever these prohibitions matter” (2013a, p.21). Anderson and Lepore note that quotation does not always eliminate the offensiveness of pejoratives (see also Saka 1998, p.122). An utterance of (32), for example, would be offensive despite the quotational use of the slur it contains:

(32)      ‘Nigger’ is a term for blacks.

Anderson and Lepore argue that content theorists will have difficulty accounting for the widespread practice of avoiding the word ‘nigger’ completely (using the locution ‘the N-word’ in place of quoting the term).

Deflationism accounts for the behavior of embedded slurs. However, it faces several objections. First, the theory offers little by way of an explanation of the practical features of slurs. (Croom 2011) Pointing out that slurs are prohibited words does not help us understand how they are such effective vehicles for spreading prejudice. Additionally, Whiting (2013) observes that it is possible for there to be slurs in the absence of taboos or social prohibitions. In a society in which the vast majority of speakers are prejudiced toward a particular racial group, and the targeted group members have internalized racist attitudes, it may be that no one objects to the use of slurs or finds them offensive, yet slurs might still be derogatory. Thus, social prohibitions cannot be all there is to the derogatoriness of slurs.

Finally, by defining slurs as merely prohibited words, Anderson and Lepore rule out a priori the possibility of slurs that are appropriate and morally permissible. One example might be ‘fascist’, which targets individuals based on political affiliation; using this slur to denigrate an authoritarian dictator need not (and perhaps should not) be prohibited.

4. Broader Applications

Since the 1980s, philosophical work on pejoratives has focused primarily on two questions: what (if anything) do pejoratives mean, and how is derogation by means of pejoratives accomplished? Researchers working on these questions would do well to familiarize themselves with empirical literature on pejoratives (for empirical studies on the behavioral and psychological effects of overhearing slurs, see Kirkland and others. 1987, Carnaghi and Maass 2007, and Gadon and Johnson 2009).

Work on slurs in the philosophy of language and linguistics has implications for debates in other disciplines. For instance, in answering the question of whether there should be legal restrictions on hate speech (which may involve the use of slurs), we will need to get clear on how hate speech harms its targets (Hornsby 2001). Legal theorists interested in these issues will want to pay careful attention to the literature discussed in this article. (For a discussion of whether laws against hate speech are justified, see Waldron 2012.)

5. References and Further Reading

  • Anderson, L. and E. Lepore 2013a, “Slurring Words,” Nous 47.1, 25-48
    • [Offers a deflationary theory of slurs]
  • Anderson, L. and E. Lepore 2013b, “What Did you Call Me? Slurs as Prohibited Words: Setting Things Up,” Analytic Philosophy 54.3, 350-363.
    • [Responds to objections to the deflationary theory defended in their 2013a]
  • Ayer, A. J. 1936, Language, Truth and Logic, Dover, New York.
    • [Defends an expressivist theory of moral and aesthetic terms]
  • Bach, K. 1994, “Conversational Impliciture,” Mind and Language 9.2, 124-162.
    •  [Argues that Grice’s distinction between what a speaker literally says and what she implies is not exhaustive, and posits a third, intermediate category]
  • Bach, K. 1999, “The Myth of Conventional Implicature,” Linguistics and Philosophy 22.4, 327-366.
    • [Argues that what is commonly held to be conventionally implicated content is actually part of what is said]
  • Brandom, R. 2000, Articulating Reasons: An Introduction to Inferentialism, Harvard University Press,      Cambridge, MA.
    • [Defends an inferentialist theory of slurs]
  • Brontsema, R. 2004, “A Queer Revolution: Reconceptualizing the Debate over Linguistic   Reclamation,” Colorado Research in Linguistics 17.1, 1-17.
    • [Gives an overview of the notion of linguistic appropriation as it applies to slurs]
  • Camp, E. 2013, “Slurring Perspectives,” Analytic Philosophy 54.3, 330-349.
    • [Defends a perspectival theory of slurs]
  • Carnaghi, A. and A. Maass 2007, “In-Group and Out-Group Perspectives in the Use of Derogatory Group Labels: Gay versus Fag,” Journal of Language and Social Psychology 26.2, 142-156.
    • [A study that measures the effects of slurs on targeted individuals compared with non-targets]
  • Croom, A.M. 2011, "Slurs," Language Sciences 33, 343-358.     
    • [Offers a stereotype theory of slurs]
  • Dummett, M. 1981, Frege: Philosophy of Language 2nd ed., Harvard University Press, Cambridge, MA.
    • [Defends an inferentialist theory of slurs]
  • Frege, G. 1892, “On Sinn and Bedeutung,” in M. Beany (ed.) 1997, The Frege Reader Blackwell, Malden, MA, 151-171.
    • [A classic paper in which Frege defends his theory of sense and reference]
  • Frege, G. 1897, “Logic,” in M. Beany (ed.) The Frege Reader, Blackwell, Malden, MA, 227-250.
    • [Frege explicates his notion of “coloring”]
  • Gadon, O. and C. Johnson 2009, “The Effect of a Derogatory Professional Label: Evaluations of a “Shrink”,” Journal of Applied Social Psychology 39.3, 634-55.
    • [Empirical study on the effects of overhearing a psychologist referred to as a ‘shrink’]
  • Geach, P. 1965, “Assertion,” Philosophical Review 69, 449-465.
    • [Poses the famous Frege-Geach problem]
  • Gibbard, A. 2003, “Reasons Thick and Thin: A Possibility Proof,’ Journal of Philosophy 100.6,  288-304.
    • [Argues that slurs are like thick evaluative terms in that they express both descriptive and evaluative content]
  • Grice, P. 1989, Studies in the Way of Words, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, MA.
    • [A collection of papers on various topics in the philosophy of language]
  • Hom, C. 2008, “The Semantics of Racial Epithets,” Journal of Philosophy 105, 416-440.
    • [Defends a truth-conditional, semantic theory of slurs]
  • Hom, C. 2010, “Pejoratives,” Philosophy Compass 5.2, 164-185.
    • [Gives a general overview of various theories of pejoratives]
  • Hom, C. 2012, “A Puzzle about Pejoratives,” Philosophical Studies 159.3, 383-405.
    • [Extends the semantic theory of slurs developed in his (2008) to swear words]
  • Hornsby, J. 2001, “Meaning and Uselessness: How to Think About Derogatory Words,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 25, 128-141.
    • [Defends a gestural theory of slurs]
  • Jeshion, R. 2013, “Slurs and Stereotypes,” Analytic Philosophy 54.3, 314-329.
    • [Raises objections to the theories of slurs developed by Hom (2008) and Camp (2013)]
  • Kaplan, D. 2004, “The Meaning of Ouch and Oops” (unpublished transcription of the Howison  Lecture in Philosophy at U.C. Berkeley)
    • [Defends a broadly expressivist theory of pejoratives]
  • Kirkland, S., J. Greenberg, and T. Pyszczynski 1987, “Further Evidence of the Deleterious Effects of Overheard Ethnic Labels: Derogation Beyond the Target,”   Personality and Social Psychology  Bulletin 13.2, 216-227.
    • [Empirical study on how overhearing the slur ‘nigger’ affects evaluations of those targeted by the slur]
  • Kripke, S. 1980, Naming and Necessity, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, MA.
    • [Gives a defense of semantic externalism]
  • Lewis, D. 1979, “Scorekeeping in a Language Game,” Journal of Philosophical Logic 8, 339-359.
    • [Offers a theory of conversational kinematics]
  • Neale, S. 1999, “Colouring and Composition,” in R. Stainton and K. Murasugi (eds.) Philosophy and Linguistics, Westview press, Boulder, CO, 35-82.
    • [Explicates Frege’s notion of coloring]
  • Potts, C. 2007, “The Expressive Dimension,” Theoretical Linguistics 33.2, 255-268.
    • [Offers a non-propositional version of the conventional implicature theory of slurs]
  • Putnam, H. 1975, “The Meaning of Meaning,” in Mind, Language and Reality: Philosophical Papers Volume 2, C.U.P., Cambridge: Cambridge, 215-271.
    • [Offers a defense of semantic externalism]
  • Richard, M. 2008, When Truth Gives Out, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, MA.
    • [Argues that utterances containing derogatory uses of slurs are not truth-apt]
  • Saka, P. 1998, “Quotation and the Use-Mention Distinction” Mind 107, 113-136.
    • [Notes that quotation does not entirely eliminate the offensiveness of swear words]
  • Saka, P. 2007, How to Think About Meaning, Springer, Berlin.
    • [Defends a hybrid expressivist theory of slurs]
  • Schlenker, P. 2007, “Expressive Presuppositions,” Theoretical Linguistics 33.2, 237-245.
    • [Defends a presupposition theory of pejoratives]
  • Soames, S. 1989, “Presupposition,” in M. Gabbay and F. Guenthner (eds.) Handbook of Philosophical Logic, Kulwer, Dordrecht, 553-616.
    • [Explicates the notion of linguistic presupposition]
  • Stenner, A.J. 1981, “A Note on Logical Truth and Non-Sexist Semantics,” in M. Vetterling-Braggin (ed.) Sexist Language: A Modern Philosophical Analysis, Littlefield, Adams and Co, New York, 299-306.
    • [Defends a conventional implicature theory of slurs]
  • Tirrell, L. 1999, “Derogatory Terms,” in C. Hendriks and K. Oliver (eds.) Language and Liberation:   Feminism, Philosophy and Language, SUNY Press, Albany, NY, 41-79.
    • [Defends an inferentialist theory of slurs]
  • Waldron, J. 2012, The Harm in Hate Speech, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, MA.
    • [Makes the case for legal restrictions on hate speech]
  • Whiting, D. 2007, “Inferentialism, Representationalism and Derogatory Words,” International Journal of Philosophical Studies 15.2, 191-205.
    • [Offers a conventional implicature theory of slurs]
  • Whiting, D. 2013, “It’s Not What You Said, It’s the Way You Said It: Slurs and Conventional Implicature,” Analytic Philosophy 54.3, 364-377.
    • [Responds to objections to the conventional implicature theory by Hom (2008) and others]
  • Williams, B. 1985, Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, MA.
    • [Explicates the notion of a thick evaluative term]
  • Williamson, T. 2009, “Reference, Inference and the Semantics of Pejoratives,” in J. Almog and P. Leonardi (eds.) The Philosophy of David Kaplan, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 137-158.
    • [Raises objections to the inferentialist theory of slurs; defends a conventional implicature theory.]


Author Information

Ralph DiFranco
University of Connecticut
U. S. A.

Ethical Expressivism

Broadly speaking, the term “expressivism” refers to a family of views in the philosophy of language according to which the meanings of claims in a particular area of discourse are to be understood in terms of whatever non-cognitive mental states those claims are supposed to express. More specifically, an expressivist theory of claims in some area of discourse, D, will typically affirm both of the following theses. The first thesis—psychological non-cognitivism—states that claims in D express mental states that are characteristically non-cognitive. Non-cognitive states are often distinguished by their world-to-mind direction of fit, which contrasts with the mind-to-world direction of fit exhibited by cognitive states like beliefs. Some common examples of non-cognitive states are desires, emotions, pro- and con-attitudes, commitments, and so forth. According to the second thesis—semantic ideationalism—the meanings or semantic contents of claims in D are in some sense given by the mental states that those claims express. This is in contrast with more traditional propositional or truth-conditional approaches to meaning, according to which the meanings of claims are to be understood in terms of either their truth-conditions or the propositions that they express.

An expressivist theory of truth claims—that is, claims of the form “p is true”—might hold that (i) “p is true” expresses a certain measure of confidence in, or agreement with, p, and that (ii) whatever the relevant mental state, for example, agreement with p, that state just is the meaning of “p is true”. In other words, when we claim that p is true, we neither describe p as true nor report the fact that p is true; rather, we express some non-cognitive attitude toward p (see Strawson 1949). Similar expressivist treatments have been given to knowledge claims (Austin 1970; Chrisman 2012), probability claims (Barker 2006; Price 2011; Yalcin 2012), claims about causation (Coventry 2006; Price 2011), and even claims about what is funny (Gert 2002; Dreier 2009).

“Ethical expressivism”, then, is the name for any view according to which (i) ethical claims—that is, claims like “x is wrong”, “y is a good person”, and “z is a virtue”—express non-cognitive mental states, and (ii) these states make up the meanings of ethical claims. (I shall henceforth use the term “expressivism” to refer only to ethical expressivism, unless otherwise noted.) This article begins with a brief account of the history of expressivism, and an explanation of its main motivations. This is followed by a description of the famous Frege-Geach Problem, and of the role that it played in shaping contemporary versions of the view. While these contemporary expressivisms may avoid the problem as it was originally posed, recent work in metaethics suggests that Geach’s worries were really just symptoms of a much deeper problem, which can actually take many forms. After characterizing this deeper problem—the Continuity Problem—and some of its more noteworthy manifestations, the article explores a few recent trends in the literature on expressivism, including the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist views. See also "Non-Cognitivism in Ethics."

Table of Contents

  1. Expressivism and Non-Cognitivism: History and Motivations
  2. The Frege-Geach Problem and Hare’s Way Out
  3. The Expressivist Turn
  4. The Continuity Problem
    1. A Puzzle about Negation
    2. Making Sense of Attitude Ascriptions
    3. Saving the Differences
  5. Recent Trends
    1. Expressivists’ Attitude Problem
    2. Hybrid Theories
    3. Recent Work in Empirical Moral Psychology
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Expressivism and Non-Cognitivism: History and Motivations

The first and primary purpose of this section is to lay out a brief history of ethical expressivism, paying particular attention to its main motivations. In addition to this, the section will also answer a question that many have had about expressivism, namely: what is the difference between expressivism and “non-cognitivism”?

The difference is partly an historical one, such that a history of expressivism must begin with its non-cognitivist ancestry. Discussions of early non-cognitivism typically involve three figures in particular—A. J. Ayer, C. L. Stevenson, and R. M. Hare—and in that respect, this one will be no different. But rather than focusing upon the substance of their views, in this section, we will be more interested in the main considerations that motivated them to take up non-cognitivism in the first place. As we shall see, early non-cognitivist views were motivated mostly by two concerns: first, a desire to avoid unwanted ontological commitments, especially to a realm of “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties; and second, a desire to capture an apparently very close connection between sincere ethical claims and motivation.

In the case of Ayer, his motivation for defending a version of non-cognitivism was relatively clear, since he explains in the Introduction of the second edition of Language, Truth, and Logic (1946), “[I]n putting forward the theory I was concerned with maintaining the general consistency of my position [logical positivism].” As is well known, logical positivists were rather austere in their ontological accommodations, and happy to let the natural sciences decide (for the most part) what gets accommodated. In fact, a common way to interpret their verificationism is as a kind of method for avoiding unwanted ontological commitments—“unwanted” because they do not conform to what Ayer himself described as his and other positivists’ “radical empiricism.” Claims in some area of discourse are meaningful, in the ordinary sense of that term—which, for Ayer, is just to say that they express propositions—only if they are either analytic or empirically verifiable. Claims that are neither analytic nor empirically verifiable—like most religious claims, for instance—are meaningless; they might express something, but not propositions.

Ayer’s positivism could perhaps make room for moral properties as long as those properties were understood as literally nothing but the natural properties into which philosophers sometimes analyze them—for example, maximizing pleasure, since this is in principle verifiable—but it left no room at all for the irreducibly normative properties that some at the time took to be the very subject-matter of ethics (see Moore 1903). So in order to “maintain the general consistency of his position,” and to avoid any commitment to empirically unverifiable, irreducibly normative properties, Ayer’s positivism meant that he had to construe ordinary ethical claims as expressing something other than propositions. Moreover, for reasons unimportant to my purposes here, he argued that these claims express non-cognitive, motivational states of mind—in particular, emotions. It is for this reason that Ayer’s brand of non-cognitivism is often referred to as “emotivism”.

Stevenson likely shared some of Ayer’s ontological suspicions, but this pretty clearly is not what led him to non-cognitivism. Rather than being concerned to maintain the consistency of any pre-conceived philosophical principles, Stevenson begins by simply observing our ordinary practices of making ethical claims, and then he asks what kind of analysis of “good” is able to make the best sense out of these practices. For instance, in practice, he thinks ethical claims are made more to influence others than to inform them. In fact, in general, Stevenson seems especially impressed with what he called the “magnetism” of ethical claims—that is, their apparently close connection to people’s motivational states. But he thinks that other attempts to analyze “good” in terms of these motivational states have failed on two counts: (a) they make genuine ethical disagreement impossible, and (b) they compromise the autonomy of ethics, assigning ethical facts to the province of psychology, or sociology, or one of the natural sciences.

According to Stevenson, these other theories err in conceiving the connection between ethical claims and motivational states in terms of the former describing, or reporting, the latter—so that, for instance, the meaning of “Torture is wrong” consists in something like the proposition that I (the speaker) disapprove of torture. This is what led to problems (a) and (b) from above: two people who are merely describing or reporting their own attitudes toward torture cannot be genuinely disagreeing about its wrongness; and if the wrongness of torture were really just a matter of people’s attitudes toward it, then ethical inquiries could apparently be settled entirely by such means as introspection, psychoanalysis, or even just popular vote. Stevenson’s non-cognitivism, then, can be understood as an attempt to capture the relation between ethical claims and motivational states in a way that avoids these problems.

The solution, he thinks, is to allow that ethical claims have a different sort of meaning from ordinary descriptive claims. If ordinary descriptive claims have propositional meaning—that is, meaning that is a matter of the propositions they express—then ethical claims have what Stevenson called emotive meaning. “The emotive meaning of a word is a tendency of a word, arising through the history of its usage, to produce (result from) affective responses in people.  It is the immediate aura of feeling which hovers about a word” (Stevenson 1937, p.23; see also Ogden and Richards 1923, 125ff). A claim like “Torture is the subject of today’s debate” may get its meaning from a proposition, but the claim “Torture is wrong” has emotive meaning, in that its meaning is somehow to be understood in terms of the motivational states that it is typically used either to express or to arouse.

If Ayer and Stevenson apparently disagreed over the meaningfulness of ethical claims, with Ayer at times insisting that such claims are meaningless, and Stevenson allowing that they have a special kind of non-propositional meaning, they were nonetheless united in affirming a negative semantic thesis, sometimes called semantic non-factualism, according to which claims in some area of discourse—in this case, ethical claims—do not express propositions, and, consequently, do not have truth-conditions. Regardless of whether or not ethical claims are meaningful in some special sense, they are not meaningful in the same way that ordinary descriptive claims are meaningful, that is, in the sense of expressing propositions. Ayer and Stevenson were also apparently united in affirming what we earlier called psychological non-cognitivism. So as the term shall be used here, ‘ethical non-cognitivism’ names any view that combines semantic non-factualism and psychological non-cognitivism, with respect to ethical claims.

According to Hare, ethical claims actually have two kinds of meaning: descriptive and prescriptive. To call a thing “good” is both (a) to say or imply that it has some context-specific set of non-moral properties; this is the claim’s descriptive meaning, and (b) to commend the thing in virtue of these properties (this is the claim’s prescriptive meaning). But importantly, the prescriptive meaning of ethical claims is primary: the set of properties that I ascribe to a thing when calling it “good” varies from context to context, but in all contexts, I use “good” for the purpose of commendation. For Hare, then, ethical claims are used not to express emotions, or to excite the emotions of others, but rather to guide actions. They do this by taking the imperative mood. That is, they are first-and-foremost prescriptions. For this reason, Hare’s view is often called “prescriptivism”.

It may be less clear than it was in the case of Ayer and Stevenson whether Hare’s prescriptivism ought to count as a version of non-cognitivism. After all, it is not uncommon to suppose that sentences in the imperative mood still have propositional content. Since he rarely goes in for talk of “expression”, it is unclear whether Hare is a psychological non-cognitivist. However, it would nonetheless be fair to say that, since prescriptions do not have truth-conditions, Hare is committed to saying that the relationship between prescriptive ethical claims and propositions is fundamentally different from that between ordinary descriptive claims and propositions; and in this sense, it does seem as if he is committed to a form of semantic non-factualism. It also seems right to think that if we do not express any sort of non-cognitive, approving attitude toward a thing when we call it “good,” then we do not really commend it. So even if he is not explicit in his adherence to it, Hare does seem to accept some form of psychological non-cognitivism as well.

Also unclear are Hare’s motivations for being an ethical non-cognitivist. By the time Hare published The Language of Morals (1952), non-cognitivism was already the dominant view in moral philosophy. So there was much less of a need for Hare to motivate the view than there was for Ayer and Stevenson a couple decades earlier. Instead, Hare’s concern was mostly to give a more thorough articulation of the view than the other non-cognitivists had, and one sophisticated enough to avoid some of the problems that had already arisen for earlier versions of the view.

One thing that does appear to have motivated Hare’s non-cognitivism, however, is its ability to explain intuitions about moral supervenience. Most philosophers agree that there is some kind of relationship between a thing’s moral status and its non-moral features, such that two things cannot have different moral statuses without also having different non-moral features. This is roughly what it means to say that a thing’s moral features supervene upon its non-moral features. For example, if it is morally wrong for Stan to lie to his teacher, but not morally wrong for Stan to lie to his mother, then there must be some non-moral difference between the two actions that underlies and explains their moral difference, for example, something to do with Stan’s reasons for lying in each case. While non-philosophers may not be familiar with the term “supervenience”, the fact that we so often hold people accountable for judging like cases suggests that we do intuitively take the moral to supervene upon the non-moral.

Those philosophers, like Moore, who believe in irreducibly normative properties must explain how it is that, despite apparently not being reducible to non-moral properties, these properties are nonetheless able to supervene upon non-moral properties, which has proven to be an especially difficult task (see Blackburn 1988b). But non-cognitivists like Hare do not shoulder this difficult metaphysical burden. Instead, they explain intuitions about moral supervenience in terms of rational consistency. If Joan commends something in virtue of its non-moral properties, but then fails to commend something else with an identical set of properties, then she is inconsistent in her commendations, and thereby betrays a certain sort of irrationality. It is this simple expectation of rational consistency, and not some complicated thesis about the ontological relations that obtain between moral and non-moral properties, that explains our intuitions about moral supervenience.

Not long after Hare’s prescriptivism hit the scene, ethical non-cognitivism would be the target of an attack from Peter Geach. Given that the attack was premised upon a point made earlier by German philosopher Gottlob Frege, it has come to be known as the Frege-Geach Problem for non-cognitivism. In the next section, we will see what the Frege-Geach Problem is. Before doing so, however, let us briefly return to the question raised at the beginning of this section: what is the difference between expressivism and non-cognitivism?

In the introduction, we saw that ethical expressivism is essentially the combination of two theses concerning ethical claims: psychological non-cognitivism and semantic ideationalism. As we will see in Sections 2 and 3, the Frege-Geach Problem pressures the non-cognitivist to say more about the meanings of ethical claims than just the non-factualist thesis that they are not comprised of truth-evaluable propositions. It is partly in response to this pressure that contemporary non-cognitivists have been moved to accept semantic ideationalism. So the difference between expressivism and non-cognitivism is historical, but it is not merely historical.  Rather, the difference is substantive as well: both expressivists and non-cognitivists accept some form of psychological non-cognitivism; but whereas the earlier non-cognitivists accepted a negative thesis about the contents of ethical claims—essentially, a thesis about how ethical claims do not get their meanings—contemporary expressivists accept a positive thesis about how ethical claims do get their meanings: ethical claims mean what they do in virtue of the non-cognitive mental states they express. It should be noted, however, that there are still many philosophers who use the terms “non-cognitivism” and “expressivism” interchangeably.

2. The Frege-Geach Problem and Hare’s Way Out

Non-cognitivist theories have met with a number of objections throughout the years, but none as famous as the so-called Frege-Geach Problem. As a point of entry into the problem, observe that there are ordinary linguistic contexts in which it seems correct to say that a proposition is being asserted, and contexts in which it seems incorrect to say that a proposition is being asserted.  Consider the following two sentences:

(1)        It is snowing.

(2)        If it is snowing, then the kids will want to play outside.

In ordinary contexts, to make claim (1) is to assert that it is snowing. That is, when a speaker utters (1), she puts forward a certain proposition—in this case, the proposition that it is snowing—as true. Accordingly, if we happen to know that it is not snowing, it could be appropriate to say that the speaker is wrong.  But when a speaker utters (2), she does not thereby assert that it is snowing. Someone can coherently utter (2) without having any idea whether it is snowing, or even knowing that it is not snowing. In the event that it is not snowing, we should not then say that the speaker of (2) is wrong. However, whether “It is snowing” is being asserted or not, it surely means the same thing in the antecedent of (2) as it does in (1). Equally, while we should not say that the speaker of (2) is wrong if it happens not to be snowing, it would nonetheless be correct, in that event, to say that both (1) and the antecedent of (2) are false.

This is what Geach calls “the Frege point,” a reference to German philosopher Gottlob Frege: “A thought may have just the same content whether you assent to its truth or not; a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition” (Geach 1965, p.449). The best way to account for the facts that (a) claim (1) and the antecedent of (2) have the same semantic contents, and that (b) they are both apparently capable of truth and falsity, is to suppose that claim (1) and the antecedent of (2) both express the proposition that it is snowing. So apparently, a claim’s expressing a proposition is something wholly independent of what a speaker happens to be doing with the claim, e.g., whether asserting it or not.

Now, we should note two things about the theories of early non-cognitivists like Ayer, Stevenson, and Hare. First, they are meant only to apply to claims in the relevant area of discourse—in this case, ethical claims—and are not supposed to generalize to other sorts of claims. In other words, theirs are apparently specialized, or “local,” semantic theories. So, for instance, most ethical non-cognitivists would agree that claim (1) expresses the proposition that it is snowing, and that this accounts for the meaning of (1). Second, perhaps understandably, ethical non-cognitivists focus their theories almost entirely upon ethical claims when they are asserted. The basic question is always something like this: what really is going on when a speaker makes an assertion of the form ‘x is wrong’? Does the speaker thereby describe x as wrong? Or might it be a kind of fallacy to assume that the speaker is engaged in an act of description, based only upon the surface grammar of the sentence? Might she instead be doing something expressive or evocative? Geach observes, “Theory after theory has been put forward to the effect that predicating some term ‘P’—which is always taken to mean: predicating ‘P’ assertorically—is not describing an object as being P but some other ‘performance’; and the contrary view is labeled ‘the Descriptive Fallacy’” (Geach 1965, p.461). Little attention is paid to ethical claims in contexts where they are not being asserted.

The Frege-Geach Problem can be understood as a consequence of these two features of non-cognitivist theories. As we saw earlier with claims (1) and (2), when we embed a claim into an unasserted context, like the antecedent of a conditional, we effectively strip the claim of its assertoric force. Claim (1) is assertoric, but the antecedent of (2) is not, despite having the same semantic content. But as Geach points out, exactly the same phenomenon occurs when we take a claim at the heart of some non-cognitivist theory and embed it into an unasserted context. This is why the Frege-Geach Problem is sometimes called the Embedding Problem. For example, consider the following two claims, similar in form to claims (1) and (2):

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

As with claims (1) and (2) above, the relationship between a speaker and claim (3) is importantly different from the relationship between a speaker and the antecedent of claim (4). At least in ordinary contexts, a speaker of (3) asserts that lying is wrong, whereas a speaker of (4) does no such thing. But, assuming “the Frege point” applies here as well, the semantic contents of (3) and the antecedent of (4) do not depend upon whether they are being asserted or not. In both cases, their contents ought to be the same; and therein lies the rub for ethical non-cognitivists.

Given that their theories are meant to apply only to ethical claims, and not to claims in other areas of discourse, non-cognitivists are apparently committed to telling a radically different story about the semantic content of (3), as compared to the propositional story they would presumably join everyone else in telling about the contents of claims like (1) and (2). But whatever story they tell about the content of (3), it is unclear how it could apply coherently to the antecedent of (4) as well. Take Ayer, for instance. According to Ayer, claim (3) is semantically no different from

(3’)      Lying!!

“where the shape and thickness of the exclamation marks show, by a suitable convention, that a special sort of moral disapproval is the feeling which is being expressed” (Ayer (1946)1952, p.107). Ayer believed that speakers of claims like (3) are not engaged in acts of description, but rather acts of expressing their non-cognitive attitudes toward various things. This is how Ayer’s theory treats the contents of ethical claims when they are asserted. Now, absent some independently compelling reason for thinking that “the Frege point” should not apply here, the same analysis ought to be given to the antecedent of (4). But the same analysis cannot be given to the antecedent of (4). For, just as a speaker can sincerely and coherently utter (2) without believing that it is snowing, a speaker can sincerely and coherently utter (4) without disapproving of lying. So whatever Ayer has to say about the content of the antecedent of (4), it cannot be that it consists in the expression of “a special sort of moral disapproval,” since a speaker of (4) does not express disapproval of lying. Apparently, then, he is committed to saying, counter-intuitively, that the contents of (3) and the antecedent of (4) are different.

As Geach poses it, the problem for the ethical non-cognitivist at this point is actually two-fold (see especially Geach 1965: 462-465). First, the non-cognitivist must explain how ethical claims are able to function as premises in logical inferences in the first place, if they do not express propositions. Traditionally, inference in logic is thought to be a matter of the truth-conditional relations that hold between propositions, and logical connectives like “and”, “or”, and “if-then” are thought to be truth-preserving functions from propositions to propositions. But as we have already seen, ethical non-cognitivists deny that ethical claims are even in the business of expressing propositions. So how, Geach wonders, are we apparently able to infer

(5)        Therefore, getting your little brother to lie is wrong

from (3) and (4), if the content of (3) is nothing more than an attitude of disapproval toward lying?  Or consider:

(6)        Lying is wrong or it isn’t.

Claim (6) can be inferred from (3) by a familiar logical principle, and in non-ethical contexts, we account for this by explaining how disjunction relates two or more propositions. But how can someone who denies that (3) expresses a proposition explain the relationship between (3) and (6)? The second part of the problem, related to the first, is that the non-cognitivist must explain why the inference from (3) and (4) to (5), for instance, is a valid one. As any introductory logic student knows well, the validity of modus ponens depends upon the minor premise and the antecedent of the major premise having the same content. Otherwise, the argument equivocates, and the inference is invalid. But as we just saw, on the theories of non-cognitivists like Ayer, claim (3) and the antecedent of (4) apparently do not have the same content. So Ayer seems committed to saying that what appears to be a straightforward instance of modus ponens is in fact an invalid argument. This is the so-called Frege-Geach Problem for non-cognitivism as Geach originally put it.

In response to an argument very much like Geach’s (see Searle 1962), Hare appears to give non-cognitivists a “way out” of the Frege-Geach Problem (Hare 1970). As Hare sees it, the matter ultimately comes down to whether or not the non-cognitivist can adequately account for the compositionality of language, that is, the way the meanings of complex sentences are composed of the meanings of their simpler parts. As has already been noted, linguists and philosophers of language have traditionally done this by telling a story about propositions and the various relations that may hold between them—the meaning of (2), for instance, is composed of (a) the proposition that it is snowing, (b) the proposition that the kids will want to play outside, and (c) the conditional function “if-then”. The challenge for the non-cognitivist is simply to find another way to account for compositionality—though, it turns out, this is no simple matter.

Hare’s own proposal was to think of the meanings of ethical claims in terms of the sorts of acts for which they are suited and not in terms of propositions or mental states. The claim “Lying is wrong,” for instance, is especially suited for a particular sort of act, namely, the act of condemning lying. Thinking of the meanings of ethical claims in this way allows Hare and other non-cognitivists to effectively concede “the Frege point,” since suitability for an act is something wholly independent of whether a claim is being asserted or not. It allows them, for instance, to say that the content of (3) is the same as the content of the antecedent of (4), which, we saw, was a problem for theories like Ayer’s. From here, accounting for the meanings of complex ethical claims, like (4) and (6), is a matter of conceiving logical connectives not as functions from propositions to propositions, but rather as functions from speech acts to speech acts. If non-cognitivists could do something like this, that is, draw up a kind of “logic of speech acts”, then they would apparently have the resources for meeting both of Geach’s challenges. They could explain how ethical claims can function as premises in logical inferences, and they could explain why some of those inferences, and not others, are valid. Unfortunately, Hare himself stopped short of working out such a logic, but his 1970 paper would nonetheless pave the way for future expressivist theories and their own responses to the Frege-Geach Problem.

3. The Expressivist Turn

Earlier, it was noted that the difference between non-cognitivism and expressivism is both historical and substantive. To repeat, ethical non-cognitivists were united in affirming the negative semantic thesis that ethical claims do not get their meanings from truth-evaluable propositions, as in semantic non-factualism. But as we have already seen with Hare, the Frege-Geach Problem pressures non-cognitivists to say something more than this, in order to account for the meanings of both simple and complex ethical claims, and to explain how some ethical claims can be inferred from others.

Contemporary ethical expressivists respond to this pressure by doing just that: while still affirming the semantic non-factualism of their non-cognitivist ancestors, expressivists nowadays add to this the thesis that was earlier called semantic ideationalism. That is, they think that the meanings of ethical claims are constituted not by propositions, but by the very non-cognitive mental states that they have long been thought to express. In other words, if non-cognitivists “removed” propositions from the contents of ethical claims, then expressivists “replace” those propositions with mental states, or “ideas”—hence, ideationalism. It is this move, made primarily in response to the Frege-Geach Problem, and by following Hare’s lead, that constitutes the historical turn from ethical non-cognitivism to ethical expressivism. Both non-cognitivists and expressivists believe that ethical claims express non-cognitive attitudes, but expressivists are distinguished in thinking of the expression relation itself as a semantic one.

Ethical expressivism is often contrasted with another theory of the meanings of ethical claims according to which those meanings are closely related with speaker’s non-cognitive states of mind, namely, ethical subjectivism. Ethical subjectivism can be understood as the view that the meanings of ethical claims are propositions, but propositions about speakers’ attitudes. So whatever the relationship between claim (1) above and the proposition that it is snowing, the same relationship holds between claim (3) and the proposition that I (the speaker) disapprove of lying. So ethical subjectivists can also, with expressivists, say that ethical claims mean what they do in virtue of the non-cognitive states that they express. But whereas the expressivist accounts for this in terms of the way the claim itself directly expresses the relevant state, the subjectivist accounts for it in terms of the speaker indirectly expressing the relevant state by expressing a proposition that refers to it.

The contrast between expressivism and subjectivism is important not only for the purpose of understanding what expressivism is, but also for seeing a significant advantage that it is supposed to have over subjectivism. Suppose Jones and Smith are engaged in a debate about the wrongness of lying, with Jones claiming that it is wrong, and Smith claiming that it is not wrong.  Presumably, for this to count as a genuine disagreement, it must be the case that their claims have incompatible contents. But according to subjectivism, the contents of their claims, respectively, are the propositions that I (Jones) disapprove of lying and that I (Smith) do not disapprove of lying. Clearly, though, these two propositions are perfectly compatible with each other. Where, then, where is the disagreement? This is often thought to be a particularly devastating problem for ethical subjectivism, that is, it cannot adequately account for genuine moral disagreement, but it is apparently not a problem for expressivists. According to expressivism, the disagreement is simply a matter of Jones and Smith directly expressing incompatible states of mind.  This is one of the advantages of supposing that the semantic contents of ethical claims just are mental states, and not propositions about mental states.

Now, recall the two motivations that first led people to accept ethical non-cognitivism. The first was a desire to avoid any ontological commitment to “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties. Moral realists, roughly speaking, are those who believe that properties like goodness and wrongness have every bit the ontological status as other, less controversial properties, like roundness and solidity, that is, moral properties are no less “real” than non-moral properties. But especially for those philosophers committed to a thoroughgoing metaphysical naturalism, it is hard to see how things like goodness and wrongness could have such a status. Especially when it is noted, as Mackie famously does, that moral properties as realists typically conceive them are somehow supposed to have a kind of built-in capacity to motivate those who apprehend them, to say nothing of how they are supposed to be apprehended, a capacity apparently not had by any other property (see Mackie 1977, p.38-42). Ethical expressivists avoid this problem by denying that people who make ethical claims are even engaged in the task of ascribing moral properties to things in the first place. Ontologically speaking, expressivism demands little more of the world than people’s attitudes and the speakers who express them, and so, it nicely satisfies the first of the two non-cognitivist desiderata.

The second desideratum was a desire to accommodate an apparently very close connection between ethical claims and motivation. In simple terms, motivational internalism is the view that a necessary condition for moral judgment is that the speaker be motivated to act accordingly. In other words, if Jones judges that lying is wrong, but has no motivation whatsoever to refrain from lying, or to condemn those who lie, or whatever, then internalists will typically say that Jones must not really judge lying to be wrong. Even if motivational internalism is false, though, it is surely right that we expect people’s ethical claims to be accompanied by motivations to act in certain ways; and when people who make ethical claims seem not to be motivated to act in these ways, we often assume either that they are being insincere or that something else has gone wrong. Sincere ethical claims just seem to “come with” corresponding motivations. Here, too, expressivism seems well suited to account for this feature of ethical claims, since they take ethical claims to directly express non-cognitive states of mind, for example, desires, emotions, attitudes, commitments, and these states are either capable of motivating by themselves, or at least closely tied to motivation. So while ethical expressivists distinguish themselves from earlier non-cognitivists by accepting the thesis of semantic ideationalism, they are no less capable of accommodating the very same considerations that motivated non-cognitivism in the first place.

Finally, return to the Frege-Geach Problem. As we saw in the previous section, Geach originally posed it as a kind of logical problem for non-cognitivists: by denying that claims in the relevant area of discourse express propositions, non-cognitivists take on the burden of explaining how such claims can be involved in logical inference, and why some such inferences are valid and others invalid. Hare took a first step toward meeting this challenge by proposing that we understand the contents of ethical claims in terms of speech acts, and then work out a kind of “logic” of speech acts. Contemporary expressivists, since they understand the contents of ethical claims not in terms of speech acts but in terms of mental states, are committed to doing something similar with whatever non-cognitive states they think are expressed by these claims. In other words, as it is sometimes put, expressivists owe us a kind of “logic of attitudes.”

Here, again, is our test case:

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

(5)        Therefore, getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

If the meanings of (3), (4), and (5) are to be understood solely in terms of mental states, and not in terms of propositions, how is it that we can infer (5) from (3) and (4)? And why is the inference valid?

In some of his earlier work on this, Blackburn (1984) answers these questions by suggesting that complex ethical claims like (4) express higher-order non-cognitive states, in this case, something like a commitment to disapproving of getting one’s little brother to lie upon disapproving of lying. If someone sincerely disapproves of lying, and is also committed to disapproving of getting her little brother to lie as long as she disapproves of lying—the two states expressed by (3) and (4), respectively—then she thereby commits herself to disapproving of getting her little brother to lie. This is one sense in which (5) might “follow from” (3) and (4), even if it is not exactly the entailment relation with which we are all familiar from introductory logic.

Furthermore, a familiar way to account for the validity of inferences like (3)-(5) is by saying that it is impossible for the premises to be true and for the conclusion to be false. But if the expressivist takes something like the approach under consideration here, he will presumably have to say something different, since it is certainly possible for someone to hold both of the attitudes expressed by (3) and (4) without also holding the attitude expressed by (5). So for instance, the expressivist might say something like this: while a person certainly can hold the attitudes expressed by (3) and (4) without also holding the attitude expressed by (5), such a person would nonetheless exhibit a kind of inconsistency in her attitudes—she would have what Blackburn calls a “fractured sensibility” (1984: 195). It is this inconsistency that might explain why the move from (3) and (4) to (5) is “valid,” provided that we allow for this alternative sense of validity. Recall, that this is essentially the same sort of inconsistency of attitudes that Hare thought underlies our intuitions about moral supervenience.

This is just one way in which expressivists might attempt to solve the Frege-Geach Problem.  Others have attempted different sorts of “logics of attitudes,” with mixed results. In early twenty-first century discourse, the debate about whether such a thing as a “logic of attitudes” is even possible—and if so, what it should look like—is ongoing.

4. The Continuity Problem

Even if expressivists can solve, or at least avoid, the Frege-Geach Problem as Geach originally posed it, there is a deeper problem that they face, a kind of “problem behind the problem”, and that will be the subject of this section. To get a sense of the problem, consider that expressivists have taken a position that effectively pulls them in two opposing directions. On the one hand, since the earliest days of non-cognitivism, philosophers in the expressivist tradition have wanted to draw some sort of sharp contrast between claims in the relevant area of discourse and claims outside of that area of discourse, that is, between ethical and non-ethical claims. But on the other hand, and this is the deeper issue that one might think lies behind the Frege-Geach Problem, ethical claims seem to behave in all sorts of logical and semantic contexts just like their non-ethical counterparts. Ethical claims are apparently no different from non-ethical claims in being (a) embeddable into unasserted contexts, like disjunctions and the antecedents of conditionals, (b) involved in logical inferences, (c) posed as questions, (d) translated across different languages, (e) negated, (f) supported with reasons, and (g) used to articulate the objects of various states of mind, for example, we can say that Jones believes that lying is wrong, Anderson regrets that lying is wrong, and Black wonders whether lying is wrong, to name just a few. It is in accounting for the many apparent continuities between ethical and non-ethical claims that expressivists run into serious problems. So call the general problem here the Continuity Problem for expressivism.

One very significant step that expressivists have taken in order to solve the Continuity Problem is to expand their semantic ideationalism to apply to claims of all sorts, and not just to claims in the relevant area of discourse. So, in the same way that ethical claims get their meanings from non-cognitive mental states, non-ethical claims get their meanings from whatever states of mind they express. In other words, expressivists attempt to solve the Continuity Problem by swapping their “local” semantic ideationalism, that is, ideationalism specifically with respect to claims in the discourse of concern, for a more “global” ideationalist semantics intended to apply to claims in all areas of discourse. This is remarkable, as it represents a wholesale departure from the more traditional propositionalist semantics according to which sentences mean what they do in virtue of the propositions they express. Recall the earlier claims:

(1)        It is snowing.

(3)        Lying is wrong.

According to most contemporary expressivists, the meanings of both (1) and (3) are to be understood in terms of the mental states they express.  Claim (3) expresses something like disapproval of lying, and claim (1) expresses the belief that it is snowing, as opposed to the proposition that it is snowing. So even if ethical and non-ethical claims express different kinds of states, their meanings are nonetheless accounted for in the same way, that is, in terms of whatever mental states the relevant claims are supposed to express.

If nothing else, this promises to be an important first step toward solving the Continuity Problem. But taking this step, from local to global semantic ideationalism, may prove to be more trouble than it is worth, as it appears to raise all sorts of other problems a few of which we shall consider here under the general banner of the Continuity Problem.

a. A Puzzle about Negation

Keeping in mind that expressivism now appears to hinge upon it being the case that an ideationalist approach to semantics can account for all of the same logical and linguistic phenomena that the more traditional propositional or truth-conditional approaches to semantics can account for, consider a simple case of negation:

(1)        It is snowing.

(7)        It is not snowing.

On an ideationalist approach to meaning, (1) gets its meaning from the belief that it is snowing, and (7) gets its meaning from either the belief that it is not snowing, or perhaps a state of disbelief that it is snowing, assuming, for now, that a state of disbelief is something different from a mere lack of belief. A claim and its negation ought to have incompatible contents, and this is apparently how an ideationalist would account for the incompatibility of (1) and (7). But now consider a case of an ethical claim and its negation:

(3)        Lying is wrong.

(8)        Lying is not wrong.

We saw these claims earlier, in Section 3, when discussing how expressivists are supposed to be able to account for genuine moral disagreement in a way better than ethical subjectivists.  Basically, expressivists account for such disagreement by supposing that a speaker of (3) and a speaker of (8) express incompatible mental states, as is the case with (1) and (7).  But if the incompatible states in the case of (1) and (7) are states of belief that p and belief that not-p (or belief and disbelief), what are the incompatible states in this case?

The non-cognitive mental state expressed by (3) is presumably something like disapproval of lying. So what is the non-cognitive state that is expressed by (8)? On the face of it, this seems like it should be an easy question to answer, but upon reflection, it turns out to be really quite puzzling. Whatever is expressed by (8), it should be something that is independently plausible as the content of such a claim, and it should be something that is somehow incompatible with the state expressed by (3). But what is it?

To see why this is puzzling, consider the following three sentences (adapted from Unwin 1999 and 2001):

(9)        Jones does not think that lying is wrong.

(10)      Jones thinks that not lying is wrong.

(11)      Jones thinks that lying is not wrong.

These three sentences say three importantly different things about Jones. Furthermore, it seems as if the state attributed to Jones in (11) should be the very same state as the one expressed by (8) above. But again, what is that state?  Let us proceed by process of elimination. It cannot be that (11) attributes to Jones a state of approval, that is, approving of lying. Presumably, for Jones to approve of lying would be for Jones to think that lying is right, or good. But that is not what (11) says; it says only that he thinks lying is not wrong. Nor can (11) attribute to Jones a lack of disapproval of lying, since that is what is attributed in (9), and as we’ve already agreed, (9) and (11) tell us different things about Jones. Moreover, (11) also cannot attribute to Jones the state of disapproval of not lying, since that is the state being attributed in (10). But at this point, it is hard to see what mental state is left to be attributed to Jones in (11), and to be the content of (8).

The expressivist does not want to say that (3) and (8) express incompatible beliefs, or states of belief and disbelief, as with (1) and (7), since beliefs are cognitive states, and we know that expressivists are psychological non-cognitivists. If (3) and (8) express beliefs, and we share with Hume the idea that beliefs by themselves are incapable of motivating, then we will apparently not have the resources for explaining the close connection between people sincerely making one of these claims and their being motivated to act accordingly. Nor does the expressivist want to say that (3) and (8) express inconsistent propositions, since that would be to abandon her semantic non-factualism. Propositions are often thought to determine truth conditions, and truth conditions are often thought to be ways the world might be. So to allow that (3) and (8) express propositions would presumably be to allow that there is a way the world might be that would make it true that lying is wrong. Furthermore, accounting for this would involve the expressivist in precisely the sort of moral metaphysical inquiries she seeks to avoid. For these reasons, it is crucial for the expressivist to find a non-cognitive mental state to be the content of (8). It must be something incompatible with the state expressed by (3), and it must be a plausible candidate for the state attributed to Jones in (11). But as we have seen, it is very difficult to articulate just what state it is.

Expressivists must show us that, even after accepting global semantic ideationalism, we are still able to account for all of the same phenomena as those accounted for by traditional propositional approaches to meaning. But here it seems they struggle even with something as simple as negation. Further, until they provide a satisfactory explanation of the contents of negated ethical claims, it will remain unclear whether they really do have a better account of moral disagreement than ethical subjectivists, as has long been claimed.

b. Making Sense of Attitude Ascriptions

Earlier, it was noted that ethical claims are no different from non-ethical claims in being able to articulate the objects of various states of mind. Let us now look closer at why expressivists may have a problem accounting for this particular point of continuity between ethical and non-ethical discourse.

(12)      Frank fears that it is snowing.

(13)      Wanda wonders whether it is snowing.

(14)      Haddie hates that it is snowing.

Claims (12)-(14) ascribe three different attitudes to Frank, Wanda, and Haddie. Clearly, however, these three attitudes have something in common, something that can be represented by the claim from earlier

(1)        It is snowing.

Traditionally, the way that philosophers of mind and language have accounted for this is by saying that (1) expresses the proposition that it is snowing, and that what all three of the attitudes ascribed to Frank, Wanda, and Haddie have in common is that they are all directed at one and the same proposition, that is, they all have the same proposition as their object.

By abandoning traditional propositional semantics, though, expressivists take on the burden of finding some other way of explaining how the contents of expressions like “fears that”, “wonders whether”, and “hates that” are supposed to relate to the content of whatever follows them. If the content of (1) is supposed to be something like the belief that it is snowing, as ideationalists suppose, and (1) is also supposed to be able to articulate the object of Frank’s fear, then the expressivist is apparently committed to thinking that Frank’s fear is actually directed at the belief that it is snowing. But, of course, Frank is not afraid of the belief that it is snowing—he is not afraid to believe that it is snowing—rather, he is afraid that it is snowing.

Things are no less problematic in the ethical case. For consider:

(15)      Frank fears that lying is wrong.

(16)      Wanda wonders whether lying is wrong.

(17)      Haddie hates that lying is wrong.

Here again, it seems right to say that the attitudes ascribed in (15)-(17) all share something in common, something that can be represented by the claim from earlier

(3)        Lying is wrong.

But if it is denied that (3) expresses a proposition, as ethical expressivists and non-cognitivists always have, it becomes unclear how (3) could be used to articulate the object of those attitudes.  Focus upon (15) for a moment. Now, what are the contents of ‘fears that’ and ‘lying is wrong’, such that the latter is the object of the former? We presumably have one answer already, from the expressivist: the content of ‘lying is wrong’ in (15), like the content of (3), is an attitude of disapproval toward lying. However, on the plausible assumption that the content of “fears that” is an attitude of fear toward the content of whatever follows, we apparently get the expressivist saying that (15) ascribes to Frank a fear of disapproval of lying, or a fear of disapproving of lying. But surely that is not what (15) ascribes to Frank. He may fear these other things as well, but (15) says only that he fears that lying is wrong.

The expressivist may try to avoid this puzzle by insisting that “lying is wrong” as it appears in (15) has a content that is different from the content of (3), but this still leaves us wondering what the meanings of claims like (15)-(17) are supposed to be, according to the expressivist’s ideationalist semantics. As Schroeder explains, expressivists “owe an account of the meaning of each and every attitude verb, for example, fears that, wonders whether, and so on; just as much as they owe an account of “not”, “and”, and “if … then”. Very little progress has yet been made on how non-cognitivists [or expressivists] can treat attitude verbs, and the prospects for further progress look dim” (Schroeder 2008d, p.716).

c. Saving the Differences

One might think that a simple way to defeat any non-factualist account of ethical claims is simply to point out that we can coherently embed ethical claims into truth claims. It makes perfect sense, for instance, for someone to say, “It is true that lying is wrong.” Presumably, however, this could only make sense if whatever follows “It is true that” is the sort of thing that can be true. Of course, propositions are among the sorts of things that can be true, in fact, this is often thought to be their distinguishing characteristic. But non-factualists deny that ethical claims express propositions. So how do they account for the fact that the truth-predicate seems to apply just as well to ethical claims as it does to non-ethical claims?

If this were a devastating problem for non-cognitivists, then the non-cognitivist tradition in ethics would not have lasted for very long, since philosophers were well aware of the matter soon after Ayer first published Language, Truth, and Logic in 1936. The thought then—essentially just an application of Ramsey’s (1927) famous redundancy theory of truth—was that, in at least some cases, the truth-predicate does not actually ascribe some metaphysically robust property being true to whatever it is being predicated of. Rather, to add the truth-predicate to a claim is to do nothing more than to simply assert the claim by itself. In claiming that “It is true that lying is wrong,” on this view, a speaker expresses the very same state that is expressed by claiming only that “Lying is wrong,” and nothing more; hence, the “redundancy” of the truth predicate.

In early twenty-first century discourse, theories like Ramsey’s are referred to as deflationary or minimalist theories of truth, since they effectively “deflate” or “minimize” the ontological significance of the truth-predicate. Some ethical expressivists, in part as a way of solving the Continuity Problem, have taken to supplementing their expressivism with deflationism. The basic idea goes something like this: if we accept a deflationary theory of truth across the board, we can apparently say that ethical claims are truth-apt, in fact, every bit as truth-apt as any other sort of claim. This allows the expressivist to avoid simple versions of the objection noted at the beginning of this section.  Interestingly, the deflationism need not stop with the truth-predicate. We might also deflate the notion of a proposition by insisting that a proposition is just whatever is expressed by a truth-apt claim. As long as we allow that ethical claims are truth-apt, in some deflationary sense, we may now be able to say, for instance, that

(3)        Lying is wrong

expresses the proposition that lying is wrong, after all. If this is allowed, then the expressivist may now have the resources for accounting for the compositionality of ethical discourse in basically the same way in which traditional propositional semanticists would do so. The meanings of complex ethical claims are to be understood in terms of the propositions expressed by their parts. Once the notion of a proposition is deflated, we might just as well deflate the notion of belief by saying something to the effect that all it is for one to believe that p is for one to accept a claim that expresses the proposition that p. In these ways, perhaps an expressivist can “earn the right” to talk of truth, propositions, and beliefs, and perhaps also knowledge, in the ethical domain, just as they do in non-ethical domains.

This is the essence of Blackburn’s brand of expressivism, known commonly nowadays as ‘quasi-realism’. As we saw earlier, moral realists are those who believe that moral properties have every bit the ontological status as other, less controversial properties, like roundness and solidity. This allows realists to account for things like truth, propositions, beliefs, and knowledge in the ethical domain in precisely the same way that we ordinarily do in other domains, such as those that include facts about roundness and solidity. By deflating the relevant notions, however, Blackburn and other moral non-realists are nonetheless supposed to be able to say all the things that realists say about moral truth, and the like; hence, “quasi”-realism.

There are at least two problems for ethical expressivists who take this approach to solving the Continuity Problem. The first is simply that deflationism is independently a very controversial view. In his own defense of a deflationary theory of truth, Paul Horwich addresses no fewer than thirty-nine “alleged difficulties” faced by such a theory (Horwich 1998). Granted, he apparently believes that all of these difficulties can be addressed with some degree of satisfaction, but few will deny that deflationary theories of truth represent a departure from the common assumption that truth is a real property of things, and that this property consists in something like a thing’s corresponding with reality. Deflationism may help expressivists avoid the Continuity Problem, but at the cost of then burdening them to defend deflationism against its many problems.

A second and more interesting problem, though, is that taking this deflationary route may, in the end, ruin what was supposed to be so unique about expressivism all along. In other words, there is a sense in which deflationism may too good a response to the Continuity Problem. After all, at the core of ethical expressivism is the belief that there is some significant difference between ethical and non-ethical discourse. Recall again our two basic instances of each:

(1)        It is snowing.

(3)        Lying is wrong.

As we just saw, once deflationism is allowed to run its course, we end up saying remarkably similar things about (1) and (3). Both are truth-apt; both express propositions; both can be the objects of belief; both can be known; and so forth. But now you may be wondering: what, then, is supposed to be the significant difference that sets (3) apart from (1)? Or, another way of putting it: what would be the point of contention between an expressivist and her opponents if both parties agreed to deflate such notions as truth, proposition, and belief? This has sometimes been called the problem of “saving the differences” between ethical and non-ethical discourse.

One response to this problem might be to say that the relevant differences between ethical and non-ethical discourse actually occur at a level below the surface of the two linguistic domains. Recall that we deflated the notion of belief by saying that to believe that p is just to accept a claim that expresses the proposition that p. Using these terms, the expressivist might say that the main difference between (1) and (3) is a matter of what is involved in “accepting” the two claims. Accepting an ethical claim like (3) is something importantly different from accepting a non-ethical claim like (1), and presumably the difference has something to do with the types of mental states involved in doing so.  Whether or not this sort of response will work is the subject of an ongoing debate in early twenty-first century philosophical literature.

5. Recent Trends

While the Continuity Problem remains a lively point, or collection of points, of debate between expressivists and their critics, it is certainly not the only topic with which those involved in the literature are currently occupied. Here we review a few other recent trends in expressivist thought, perhaps the most notable among them being the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist theories.

a. Expressivists’ Attitude Problem

There are some who would say that the Continuity Problem just is the Frege-Geach Problem, that is, that the Frege-Geach Problem ought to be understood very broadly, so as to include all of the many issues associated with the apparent logical and semantic continuities between ethical and non-ethical discourse. Even so, ethical expressivism faces other problems as well. Let us now look briefly at an issue that is receiving more and more attention these days—the so-called Moral Attitude Problem for ethical expressivism.

Recall again that expressivists often claim to have a better way of accounting for the nature of moral disagreement than the account on offer from ethical subjectivists. The idea, according to the expressivist, is supposed to be that a moral disagreement is ultimately just a disagreement in non-cognitive attitudes. Rather than expressing propositions about their opposing attitudes—which, we saw earlier, would be perfectly compatible with each other—the two disagreeing parties directly express those opposing non-cognitive attitudes. But then, in our discussion of the puzzle about negation, we saw that the expressivist may actually owe us more than this. Specifically, she owes us an explanation of what, exactly, those opposing attitudes are supposed to be. If Jones claims that lying is wrong, and Smith claims that it is not wrong, then Jones and Smith are engaged in a moral disagreement about lying. The expressivist, presumably, will say that Jones expresses something like disapproval of lying. But then what is the state that is directly expressed by Smith’s claim, such that it is disagrees, or is incompatible, with Jones’ disapproval?

According to the Moral Attitude Problem, the issue actually runs deeper than this, for there are more constraints on the expressivist’s answer than just that the state expressed by Smith be something incompatible with Jones’ disapproval of lying. In fact, Jones’ disapproval of lying may turn out to be no less mysterious than whatever sort of state is supposed to be expressed by Smith. After all, we disapprove of all sorts of things. Suppose that Jones also disapproves of Quentin Tarantino movies, but Smith does not. Presumably, this would not count as a moral disagreement, despite the fact that Jones and Smith are expressing mental states similar to those expressed in their disagreement about lying. So what is it, according to ethical expressivism, that makes the one disagreement, and not the other, a moral disagreement? This is especially puzzling given that expressivists often clarify their view by saying that moral disagreements are more like aesthetic disagreements, like a disagreement over Tarantino films; than they are like disagreements over facts, such as whether or not it is snowing.

So the Moral Attitude Problem, basically, is the problem of specifying the exact type, or types, of attitude expressed by ethical claims, such that someone expressing the relevant state counts as making an ethical claim—as opposed to an aesthetic claim, or something else entirely. Judith Thomson raises something like the Moral Attitude Problem when she writes,

The [ethical expressivist] needs to avail himself of a special kind of approval and disapproval: these have to be moral approval and moral disapproval.  For presumably he does not wish to say that believing Alice ought to do a thing is having toward her doing it the same attitude of approval that I have toward the sound of her splendid new violin. (Thomson 1996, p.110)

And several years later, in a paper entitled “Some Not-Much-Discussed Problems for Non-Cognitivism in Ethics,” Michael Smith raises the same problem:

[Ethical expressivists] insist that it is analytic that when people sincerely make normative claims they thereby express desires or aversions.  But which desires and aversions … , and what special feature do they possess that makes them especially suitable for expression in a normative claim? (Smith 2001, p.107)

But it is only very recently that expressivists and their opponents have begun to give the Moral Attitude Problem the attention that it deserves (see Merli 2008; Kauppinen 2010; Köhler 2013; Miller 2013, pp.39-47, pp.81-87; and Björnsson and McPherson 2014)

What can the expressivist say in response? For starters, expressivists can, and should, point out that the Moral Attitude Problem is not unique to their view. Indeed, those who think that ethical claims express cognitive states, like beliefs—namely, ethical cognitivists—face a very similar challenge: Jones believes both that lying is wrong and that Quentin Tarantino movies are bad, but only one of these counts as a moral belief; what is it, exactly, that distinguishes the moral from the non-moral belief? Cognitivists will say that the one belief has a moral proposition as its content, whereas the other belief does not. But that just pushes the question back a step: what, now, is it that distinguishes the moral from the non-moral proposition? Whether it be a matter of spelling out the difference between moral and non-moral beliefs, or that between moral and non-moral propositions, cognitivists are no less burdened to give an account of the nature of moral thinking than are ethical expressivists.

In fact, Köhler argues that expressivists can actually take what are essentially the same routes in response to the Moral Attitude Problem as those taken by cognitivists. Cognitivists, he thinks, have just two options: they can either (a) characterize the nature of moral thinking by reference to some realm of sui generis moral facts which, when they are the objects of beliefs, make those beliefs moral beliefs, or else (b) do the same, but without positing a realm of sui generis moral facts, and instead identifying moral facts with some set of non-moral facts. Similarly, it seems expressivists have two options: they can either (a) say that “the moral attitude” is some sui generis state of mind, or else (b) insist that “the moral attitude” can be analyzed in terms of non-cognitive mental states with which we are already familiar, like desires and aversions, approval and disapproval, and so forth.

The second of these options for expressivists is certainly the more popular of the two. But according to Köhler, if expressivists are to be successful in taking this approach, they ought to conceive of the identity between “the moral attitude” and other, more familiar non-cognitive states in much the same way that naturalistic moral realists conceive of the identity between moral and non-moral facts—that is, either by insisting that the identity is synthetic a posteriori, as the so-called “Cornell realists” do with moral and non-moral facts, or by insisting that the identity is conceptual, but non-obvious, an approach to conceptual analysis proposed by David Lewis, and recently taken up by a few philosophers from Canberra. Otherwise, if an expressivist is comfortable allowing for a sui generis non-cognitive mental state to hold the place of “the moral attitude,” she should get to work explaining what this state is like. Indeed, Köhler argues that this can be done without violating expressivism’s long-standing commitment to metaphysical naturalism (see Köhler 2013, pp.495-507).

b. Hybrid Theories

Perhaps the most exciting of recent trends in the expressivism literature is the advent of so-called “hybrid” expressivist theories. The idea behind hybrid theories, very basically, is that we might be able to secure all of the advantages of both expressivism and cognitivism by allowing that ethical claims express both non-cognitive and cognitive mental states. Why call them hybrid expressivist views, then, and not hybrid cognitivist views? Recall that the two central theses of ethical expressivism are psychological non-cognitivism—the thesis that ethical claims express mental states that are characteristically non-cognitive—and semantic ideationalism—the thesis that the meanings of ethical claims are to be understood in terms of the mental states that they express. Since neither of these theses state that ethical claims express only non-cognitive states, the hybrid theorist can affirm both of them whole-heartedly. For that reason, hybrid theories are generally considered to be forms of expressivism.

The idea that a single claim might express two distinct mental states is not a new one. Philosophers of language have long thought, for instance, that slurs and pejoratives are capable of doing this. Consider the term “yankee” as used by people living in the American South. In most cases, among Southerners, to call someone a “yankee” is to express a certain sort of negative attitude toward the person. But importantly, the term “yankee” cannot apply to just anyone, rather, it applies only to people who are from the North. Acordingly, when native Southerner Roy says, “Did you hear?  Molly’s dating a yankee!” he expresses both (a) a belief that Molly’s partner is from the North, and (b) a negative attitude toward Molly’s partner. It seems we need to suppose that Roy has and expresses both of these states—one cognitive, the other non-cognitive—in order to make adequate sense of the meaning of his claim. In much the same way, hybrid theorists in metaethics suggest that ethical claims can express both beliefs and attitudes. Indeed, these philosophers often model their theories on an analogy to the nature of slurs and pejoratives (see Hay 2013).

Even within the expressivist tradition, the language of hybridity may be new, but the basic idea is not. Recall from earlier that Hare believed ethical claims have two sorts of meaning: descriptive meaning and prescriptive meaning. To claim that something is “good,” he thinks, is to both (a) say or imply that it has some context-specific set of non-moral properties; this is the claim’s descriptive meaning, and (b) commend the thing in virtue of these properties; this is the claim’s prescriptive meaning. This is not far off from a hybrid view according to which “good”-claims express both (a) a belief that something has some property or properties, and (b) a positive non-cognitive attitude toward the thing. Hare was apparently ahead of his time in this respect. The hybrid movement as it is now known is less than a decade old.

One of the earliest notable hybrid views is Ridge’s “ecumenical expressivism” (see Ridge 2006 and 2007). In its initial form, ecumenical expressivism is the view that ethical claims express two closely related mental states—one a belief, and the other a non-cognitive state like approval or disapproval. Furthermore, as an instance of semantic ideationalism, ecumenical expressivism adds that the literal meanings, or semantic contents, of ethical claims are to be understood solely in terms of these mental states. So, for example, the claim

(3)        Lying is wrong

expresses something like these two states: (a) disapproval of things that have a certain property F, and (b) a belief that lying has property F. Notably, the view allows for a kind of subjectivity to moral judgment, since the nature of property F will differ from person to person. A utilitarian, for instance, might disapprove of behavior that fails to maximize utility; a Kantian might instead disapprove of behavior that disrespects people’s autonomy; and so on and so forth. Furthermore, Ridge’s view is supposed to be able to solve the Frege-Geach Problem by conceiving of logical inference and validity in terms of the relationships that obtain among beliefs.

(4)        If lying is wrong, then getting your little brother to lie is wrong.

According to ecumenical expressivism, complex ethical claims like (4) also express two states: (a) disapproval of things that have a certain property F, and (b) the complex belief that if lying has property F, then getting one’s little brother to lie has property F as well. Coupled with an account of logical validity understood in terms of consistency of beliefs, this looks like a promising way to satisfy Geach’s two challenges. (Ridge has since updated his view so that it is no longer a semantic theory, but rather a meta-semantic theory. Thus, rather than attempting to assign literal meanings to ethical claims, Ridge means only to explain that in virtue of which ethical claims have the meanings that they do. See Ridge 2014.)

The implicature-style views defended by Copp and Finlay also fall within the hybrid camp (Copp 2001, 2009; Finlay 2004, 2005). Coined by philosopher H. Paul Grice, the term “implicature” refers to a semantic phenomenon in which a speaker means or implies one thing, while saying something else. A popular example is that of the professor who writes, “Alex has good handwriting,” in a letter of recommendation. What the professor says is that Alex has good handwriting, but what the professor means or implies is that Alex is not an especially good student. So the claim “Alex has good handwriting” has both a literal content, that Alex has good handwriting, and an implicated content, that Alex is not an especially good student.

In the same way, Copp and Finlay suggest that ethical claims have both literal and implicated contents. Once again:

(3)        Lying is wrong

According to these implicature-style views, someone who sincerely utters (3) thereby communicates two things. First, she either expresses a belief, or asserts a proposition, to the effect that lying is wrong—this is the claim’s literal content. Second, she implies that she has some sort of non-cognitive attitude toward lying—this is the claim’s implicated content. It is in this way that implicature-style views are supposed to capture the virtues of both cognitivism and expressivism. Where Copp and Finlay disagree is over the matter of what it is in virtue of which the non-cognitive attitude is implicated. According to Copp, it is a matter of linguistic conventions that govern ethical discourse; whereas Finlay thinks it is a matter of the dynamics of ethical conversation. So Copp’s view is an instance of conventional implicature, while Finlay’s is an instance of conversational implicature.

There may be yet another way to “go hybrid” with one’s expressivism. Rather than hybridizing the mental state(s) expressed by ethical claims, one might instead hybridize the very notion of expression itself. This is the route taken by defenders of a view known as ‘ethical neo-expressivism’ (Bar-On and Chrisman 2009; Bar-On, Chrisman, and Sias 2014). Ethical neo-expressivism rests upon two very important distinctions. The first is a distinction between two different kinds of expression. When we say that agents express their mental states and that sentences express propositions, we refer not just to two different instances of expression, but more importantly, to two different kinds expression, which are often conflated by expressivists.  To see how the two kinds of expression come apart, consider:

(18)      It is so great to see you!

(19)      I am so glad to see you!

Intuitively, these two sentences have different semantic contents. Setting aside complicated issues related to indexicality, sentence (18) expresses the proposition that it is so great to see you (the addressee), and sentence (19) expresses the proposition that I (the speaker) am so glad to see you (the addressee). However, these two different sentences might nonetheless function as vehicles for expressing the same mental state, that is, I might express my gladness or joy at seeing a friend by uttering either of them. Indeed, I might also do so by hugging my friend, or even just by smiling. Importantly, the neo-expressivist urges, it is not the speaker who expresses this or that proposition, but the sentences. People cannot express propositions, but sentences can, in virtue of being conventional representations of them. However, it is not the sentences that express gladness or joy, but the speaker. Sentences cannot express mental states; they are just strings of words. But people can certainly express their mental states by performing various acts, some of which involve the utterance of sentences. Call the relation between sentences and propositions semantic-expression, or s-expression; and call the relation between agents and their mental states action-expression, or a-expression.

According to neo-expressivists, most ethical expressivists, including most hybrid theorists, conflate these two senses of expression because they fail to adequately recognize a second distinction. Notice that terms like “claim”, “judgment”, and “statement” are ambiguous: they might refer either to an act or to the product of that act. So the term “ethical claim” might refer either to the act of making an ethical claim, or to the product of this act—which, presumably, is a sentence tokened either in thought or in speech. This distinction between ethical claims understood as acts and ethical claims understood as products maps nicely onto the earlier distinction between a- and s-expression. Understood as acts, ethical claims are different from non-ethical claims in that, when making an ethical claim, a speaker a-expresses some non-cognitive attitude. In this way, neo-expressivists can apparently affirm psychological non-cognitivism, and may also have the resources for “saving the differences” between ethical and non-ethical discourse. On the other hand, understood as products—that is, sentences containing ethical terms—ethical claims are just like non-ethical claims in s-expressing propositions, and not necessarily in the deflationary sense of proposition noted above. By allowing that ethical claims express propositions, the neo-expressivist may have all she needs in order to avoid the Continuity Problem.

Now, according to some, semantic ideationalism is essential to expressivism. Gibbard, for instance, writes, “The term ‘expressivism’ I mean to cover any account of meanings that follow this indirect path: to explain the meaning of a term, explain what states of mind the term can be used to express” (2003, p.7). However, ethical neo-expressivism, as we have just seen, rejects semantic ideationalism in favor of the more traditional propositional approach to meaning. In light of this, one might legitimately wonder whether neo-expressivism ought to count as an expressivist view. But as Bar-On, Chrisman, and Sias (2014) argue, neo-expressivism is perfectly capable of accommodating both of the main motivations of non-cognitivism and expressivism described in Sections 1 and 3—that is, avoiding a commitment to “spooky,” irreducibly normative properties, and accounting for the close connection between sincere ethical claims and motivation.  Besides, as we saw earlier, it looks like the expressivist’s commitment to semantic ideationalism is what got her into trouble with the Continuity Problem in the first place. So even if neo-expressivism represents something of a departure from mainstream expressivist thought, it may nonetheless be a departure worth considering.

c. Recent Work in Empirical Moral Psychology

Expressivists have long recognized that it is possible to make an ethical claim without being in whatever is supposed to be the corresponding non-cognitive mental state. It is possible, for instance, to utter

(3)        Lying is wrong

without, at the same time, disapproving of lying. Maybe the speaker is just reciting a line from a play; or maybe the speaker suffers from a psychological disorder that renders him incapable of ever being in the relevant non-cognitive state, and he is just repeating something that he has heard others say. These are surely possibilities, and expressivists have at times had different things to say about them, and other cases like them. Either way, though, expressivists generally assume that ethical claims are nonetheless tied to non-cognitive states in a way that justifies us in thinking that a speaker of an ethical claim, if she is being sincere, ought to be motivated to act accordingly. This is one of the two main motivations that attract people to theories in the expressivist tradition.

The assumption that sincere ethical claims in ordinary cases are accompanied by non-cognitive states is presumably one that has empirical implications.  If true, for instance, one might expect to find activity in regions of the brain associated with such states as people make ethical claims sincerely. Indeed, this is precisely what researchers in empirical moral psychology have found throughout various studies conducted over the past few decades. From brain scans to behavioral experiments, tests of skin conductance to moral judgment surveys given in disgusting environments, study after study seems to confirm a view that is sometimes called “psychological sentimentalism”—that is, the view that people are prompted to make the ethical claims that they make primarily by their emotional responses to things.

Now, to be sure, the link posited by psychological sentimentalism is a causal one—our emotions cause us to make certain ethical claims—and that is importantly different from the conceptual link that expressivists generally assume exists between non-cognitive states and ethical claims. But expressivists may nonetheless benefit from exploring how recent work in empirical moral psychology can be used to support parts of their view—for example, how it is that the conceptual link is supposed to have come about. If nothing else, expressivists may find significant empirical support for the view, shared by everyone in the tradition since Ayer, that ethical claims are expressions of characteristically non-cognitive states of mind.

6. References and Further Reading

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  • Barker, S. (2006). “Truth and the Expressing in Expressivism.” In Horgan, T. and Timmons, M. (eds.). Metaethics after Moore. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bar-On, D. and M. Chrisman (2009). “Ethical Neo-Expressivism.” In R. Shafer-Landau (ed.). Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 4. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bar-On, D., M. Chrisman, and J. Sias (2014). “(How) Is Ethical Neo-Expressivism a Hybrid View.” In M. Ridge and G. Fletcher (eds.), Having It Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Björnsson, G. and T. McPherson (2014). “Moral Attitudes for Non-Cognitivists: Solving the Specification Problem,” Mind,
  • Blackburn, S. (1984). Spreading the Word. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Blackburn, S. (1988a). “Attitudes and Contents.” Ethics 98: 501-17.
  • Blackburn, S. (1988b). “Supervenience Revisited.” In G. Sayre-McCord (ed.), Essays on Moral Realism. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Blackburn, S. (1998). Ruling Passions. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Boisvert, D. (2008). “Expressive-Assertivism.” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 89(2): 169-203.
  • Boyd, R. (1988). “How to Be a Moral Realist.” In G. Sayre-McCord (ed.), Essays on Moral Realism. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Brink, D. (1989). Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chrisman, M. (2008). “Expressivism, Inferentialism, and Saving the Debate.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 77: 334-358.
  • Chrisman, M. (2012). “Epistemic Expressivism.” Philosophy Compass 7(2): 118-126.
  • Copp, D. (2001). “Realist-Expressivism: A Neglected Option for Moral Realism.” Social Philosophy and Policy 18(2): 1-43.
  • Copp, D. (2009). “Realist-Expressivism and Conventional Implicature.” In Shafer-Landau, R. (ed.). Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 4. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Coventry, A. (2006). Hume’s Theory of Causation: A Quasi-Realist Interpretation. London: Continuum.
  • Divers, J. and A. Miller (1994). “Why Expressivists About Value Should Not Love Minimalism About Truth.” Analysis 54: 12-19.
  • Dreier, J. (2004). “Meta-Ethics and the Problem of Creeping Minimalism.” Philosophical Perspectives 18: 23-44.
  • Dreier, J. (2009). “Relativism (and Expressivism) and the Problem of Disagreement.” Philosophical Perspectives 23: 79-110.
  • Finlay, S. (2004). “The Conversational Practicality of Value Judgment.” The Journal of Ethics 8: 205-223.
  • Finlay, S. (2005). “Value and Implicature.” Philosophers’ Imprint 5: 1-20.
  • Geach, P. (1965). “Assertion.” Philosophical Review 74: 449-465.
  • Gert, J. (2002). “Expressivism and Language Learning.” Ethics 112: 292-314.
  • Gibbard, A. (1990). Wise Choices, Apt Feelings. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Gibbard, A. (2003). Thinking How to Live. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Greene, J. D. (2008). “The Secret Joke of Kant’s Soul.” In Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Moral Psychology, Vol. 3: The Neuroscience of Morality: Emotion, Brain Disorders, and Development. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, pp. 35-79.
  • Greene, J. D. and J. Haidt (2002). “How (and Where) Does Moral Judgment Work?” Trends in Cognitive Sciences 6: 517-523.
  • Haidt, J. (2001). “The Emotional Dog and Its Rational Tail: A Social Intuitionist Approach to Moral Judgment.” Psychological Review 108(4): 814-834.
  • Hare, R. M. (1952). The Language of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hare, R. M. (1970). “Meaning and Speech Acts.” The Philosophical Review 79: 3-24.
  • Hay, Ryan. (2013). “Hybrid Expressivism and the Analogy between Pejoratives and Moral Language.” European Journal of Philosophy 21(3): 450-474.
  • Horwich, P. (1998). Truth. Second Edition. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Jackson, F. (1998). From Metaphysics to Ethics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Jackson, F. and P. Pettit (1995). “Moral Functionalism and Moral Motivation.” Philosophical Quarterly 45: 20-40.
  • Kauppinen, A. (2010). “What Makes a Sentiment Moral?” In R. Shafer-Landau (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 5. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Köhler, S. (2013). “Do Expressivists Have an Attitude Problem?” Ethics 123(3): 479-507.
  • Lewis, D. (1970). “How to Define Theoretical Terms.” Journal of Philosophy 67: 427-446.
  • Lewis, D. (1972). “Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 50: 249-258.
  • Mackie, J. L. (1977). Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. London: Penguin.
  • Merli, D. (2008). “Expressivism and the Limits of Moral Disagreement.” Journal of Ethics 12: 25-55.
  • Miller, A. (2013). Contemporary Metaethics: An Introduction. Second Edition. Cambridge: Polity.
  • Moore, G. E. (1903). Principia Ethica. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nichols, S. (2004). Sentimental Rules: On the Natural Foundations of Moral Judgment. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Ogden, C. K. and I. A. Richards (1923). The Meaning of Meaning. New York: Harcourt Brace & Jovanovich.
  • Price, H. (2011). “Expressivism for Two Voices.” In J. Knowles and H. Rydenfelt (eds.). Pragmatism, Science, and Naturalism. Peter Lang.
  • Prinz, J. (2006). “The Emotional Basis of Moral Judgments.” Philosophical Explorations 9(1): 29-43.
  • Ramsey, F. P. (1927). “Facts and Propositions.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 7 (Supplementary): 153-170.
  • Ridge, M. (2006). “Ecumenical Expressivism: Finessing Frege.” Ethics 116: 302-336.
  • Ridge, M. (2007). “Ecumenical Expressivism: The Best of Both Worlds?” In Shafer-Landau, R. (ed.). Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 2. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ridge, M. (2014). Impassioned Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ridge, M. and G. Fletcher, eds. (2014). Having It Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schroeder, M. (2008a). Being For: Evaluating the Semantic Program of Expressivism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schroeder, M. (2008b). “Expression for Expressivists.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 76(1): 86-116.
  • Schroeder, M. (2008c). “How Expressivists Can and Should Solve Their Problem with Negation.” Noûs 42(4): 573-599.
  • Schroeder, M. (2008d). “What is the Frege-Geach Problem?” Philosophy Compass 3(4): 703-720.
  • Schroeder, M. (2009). “Hybrid Expressivism: Virtues and Vices.” Ethics 119(2): 257-309.
  • Searle, J. (1962). “Meaning and Speech Acts.” Philosophical Review 71 (1962): 423-32.
  • Searle, J. (1969). Speech Acts: An Essay in the Philosophy of Language. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Smith, M. (1994a). The Moral Problem. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Smith, M. (1994b). “Why Expressivists About Value Should Love Minimalism About Truth.” Analysis 54: 1-12.
  • Smith, M. (2001). “Some Not-Much-Discussed Problems for Non-Cognitivism in Ethics.” Ratio 14: 93-115.
  • Stevenson, C. L. (1937). “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms.” Mind 46: 14-31.
  • Stevenson, C. L. (1944). Ethics and Language. New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • Strawson, P. F. (1949). “Truth.” Analysis 9: 83-97.
  • Thomson, J. (1996). “Moral Objectivity.” In G. Harman and J. Thomson, Moral Relativism and Moral Objectivity (Great Debates in Philosophy). Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Unwin, N. (1999). “Quasi-Realism, Negation and the Frege-Geach Problem.” Philosophical Quarterly 49: 337-352.
  • Unwin, N. (2001). “Norms and Negation: A Problem for Gibbard’s Logic.” Philosophical Quarterly 51: 60-75.
  • Yalcin, S. (2012). “Bayesian Expressivism.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society CXII(2): 123-160.

Author Information

James Sias
Dickinson College
U. S. A.

Metaphor and Phenomenology

 The term “contemporary phenomenology” refers to a wide area of 20th and 21st century philosophy in which the study of the structures of consciousness occupies center stage. Since the appearance of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason and subsequent developments in phenomenology and hermeneutics after Husserl, it has no longer been possible to view consciousness as a simple scientific object of study. It is, in fact, the precondition for any sort of meaningful experience, even the simple apprehension of objects in the world. While the basic features of phenomenological consciousness – intentionality, self-awareness, embodiment, and so forth—have been the focus of analysis, Continental philosophers such as Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida go further in adding a linguistically creative dimension. They argue that metaphor and symbol act as the primary interpreters of reality, generating richer layers of perception, expression, and meaning in speculative thought. The interplay of metaphor and phenomenology introduces serious challenges and ambiguities within long-standing assumptions in the history of Western philosophy, largely with respect to the strict divide between the literal and figurative modes of reality based in the correspondence theory of truth. Since the end of the 20th century, the role of metaphor in the production of cognitive structures has been taken up and extended in new productive directions, including “naturalized phenomenology” and straightforward cognitive science, notably in the work of G. Lakoff and M. Johnson, M. Turner, D. Zahavi, and S. Gallagher.

Table of Contents

  1. Overview
    1. The Conventional View: Aristotle’s Contribution to Substitution Model
    2. The Philosophical Issues
    3. Nietzsche’s Role in Development of Phenomenological Theories of Metaphor
  2. The Phenomenological Theory in Continental Philosophy
    1. Phenomenological Method: Husserl
    2. Heidegger’s Contribution
  3. Existential Phenomenology: Paul Ricoeur, Hermeneutics, and Metaphor
    1. The Mechanics of Conceptual Blending
    2. The Role of Kant’s Schematism in Conceptual Blending
  4. Jacques Derrida: Metaphor as Metaphysics
    1. The Dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida
  5. Anglo-American Philosophy: Interactionist Theories
  6. Metaphor, Phenomenology, and Cognitive Science
    1. The Embodied Mind
    2. The Literary Mind
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Overview

This article highlights the definitive points in the ongoing philosophical conversation about metaphorical language and it’s centrality in phenomenology. The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, at times presented as a critique, is a radical alternative to the conventional analysis of metaphor. The conventional view, largely inherited from Aristotle, is also known as the “substitution model.” In the traditional, or standard approach, the uses and applications of metaphor have been restricted to (along with other related symbolic phenomena/tropes) the realms of rhetoric and poetics. In this view, metaphor is none other than a kind of categorical mistake, a deviance of sense produced in order to create a lively effect.

While somewhat contested, the standard substitution theory, also referred to as the “similarity theory,” generally defines metaphor as a stylistic literary device involving a deviant and dyadic movement which shifts meaning from one word to another. This view, first and most thoroughly articulated by Aristotle, reinforces the epistemic primacy of the literal, where metaphor can only operate as a secondary device, one which is dependent on the prior level of ordinary descriptive language, where the first-order language in itself contains nothing metaphorical. In most cases, the relation between two orders, literal and figurative, has been interpreted as an implicit simile, which expresses a “this is that” structure. For example, Aristotle mentions, in Poetics: 

When the poet says of Achilles that he “Leapt on the foe as a lion,” this is a simile; when he says of him, “the lion leapt” it is a metaphor—here, since both are courageous, [Homer] has transferred to Achilles the name of “lion.” (1406b 20-3)

In purely conventional terms, poetic language can only be said to refer to itself; that is, it can accomplish imaginative description through metaphorical attribution, but the description does not refer to any reality outside of itself. For the purposes of traditional rhetoric and poetics in the Aristotelian mode, metaphor may serve many purposes; it can be clever, creative, or eloquent, but never true in terms of referring to new propositional content. This is due to the restriction of comparison to substitution, such that the cognitive impact of the metaphoric transfer of meaning is produced by assuming similarities between literal and figurative domains of objects and the descriptive predicates attributed to them.

The phenomenological interpretation of metaphor, however, not only challenges the substitution model, it advances the role of metaphor far beyond the limits of traditional rhetoric. In the Continental philosophical tradition, the most extensive developments of metaphor’s place in phenomenology are found in the work of Martin Heidegger, Paul Ricoeur and Jacques Derrida. They all, in slightly different ways, see figurative language as the primary vehicle for the disclosure and creation of new forms of meaning which emerge from an ontological, rather than purely epistemic or objectifying engagement with the world.

a. The Conventional View: Aristotle’s Contribution to Substitution Model

Metaphor consists in giving the thing a name that belongs to something else; the transference being either from species to genus, or from genus to species, or from species to species, on the grounds of analogy. (Poetics 1457b 6-9)

 While his philosophical predecessor Plato condemns the use of figurative speech for its role in rhetorike, “the art of persuasion,” Aristotle recognizes its stylistic merits and provides us with the first systematic analysis of metaphor and its place in literature and the mimetic arts. His briefer descriptions of how metaphors are to be used can be found in Rhetoric and Poetics, while his extended analysis of how metaphor operates within the context of language as a whole can be inferred by reading On Interpretation together with Metaphysics. The descriptive use of metaphor can be understood as an extension of its meaning; the term derives from the Greek metaphora, from metaphero, meaning “to transfer or carry over.” Thus, the figurative trope emerges from a movement of substitution, involving the transference of a word to a new sense, one which compares or juxtaposes seemingly unrelated subjects.  For example, in Shakespeare’s Sonnet 73:

In me thou seest the glowing of such fire,
That on the ashes of his youth doth lie…

The narrator directly transfers and applies the “dying ember” image in a new “foreign” sense: his own awareness of his waning youth.

This is Aristotle’s contribution to the standard substitution model of metaphor. It is to be understood as a linguistic device, widely applied but remaining within the confines of rhetoric and poetry. Though it does play a central role in social persuasion, metaphor, restricted by the mechanics of similarity and substitution, does not carry with it any speculative or philosophical importance. Metaphors may point out underlying similarities between objects and their descriptive categories, and may instruct through adding liveliness and elegance to speech, but they do not refer, in the strong sense, to a form of propositional knowledge.

The formal structure of substitution operates in the following manner: the first subject or entity under description in one context is characterized as equivalent in some way to the second entity derived from another context; it is either implied or stated that the first entity “is” the second entity in some way. The metaphorical attribution occurs when certain select properties from the second entity are imposed on the first in order to characterize it in some distinctive way. Metaphor relies on pre-existing categories which classify objects and their properties; these categories guide the ascription of predicates to objects, and since metaphor may entail a kind of violation of this order, it cannot itself refer to a “real” class of existing objects or the relations between them. Similarly, in poetry, metaphor serves not as a foundation for knowledge, but as a tool for mimesis or artistic imitation, representing the actions in epic tragedy or mythos in order to move and instruct the emotions of the audience for the purpose of catharsis.

Aristotle’s theory and its significance for philosophy can only be fully understood in terms of the wider context of denotation and reference which supports the classical realist epistemology. Metaphor is found within his taxonomy of speech forms; additionally, simile is subordinate to metaphor and both are figures of speech falling under the rubric of lexis/diction, which itself is composed of individual linguistic units or noun-names and verbs. Lexis operates within the unity of logos, meaning that the uses of various forms of speech must conform to the overall unity of language and reason, held together by categorical structures of being found in Aristotle’s metaphysics.

As a result of Aristotle’s combined thinking in these works, it turns out that the ostensive function of naming individual objects (“this” name standing for “this object” or property) allows for the clear demarcation between the literal and figurative meanings for names. Thus, the noun-name can work as a signifier of meaning in two domains, the literal and the non-literal. However, there remains an unresolved problem: the categorical nature of the boundary between literal and figurative domains will be a point of contention for many contemporary critiques of the theory coming from phenomenological philosophy.

Furthermore, the denotative theory has served in support of the referential function of language, one which assumes a system of methodological connections between language, sense perceptions, mental states, and the external world. The referential relation between language and its objects serves the correspondence theory of truth, in that the truth-bearing capacity of language corresponds to valid perception and cognition of the external world. The theory assumes that these sets of correspondences allow for the consistent and reliable relation of reference between words, images, and objects.

Aristotle accounts for this kind of correspondence in the following way: sense perceptions’s pathemata give rise to the psychological states in which object representations are formed. These states are actually likenesses (isomorphisms) of the external objects. Thus, names for things refer to the things themselves, mental representations of those things, and to the class-based meanings.

If, as Aristotle assumes, the meaning of metaphor rests on the level of the noun-name, its distinguishing feature lies in its deviation, a “something which happens” to the noun/name by virtue of a transfer (epiphora) of meaning. Here, Aristotle creates a metaphor (based on physical movement) in order to explain metaphor. The term “phora” refers to a change in location from one place to another, to which is added the prefix “epi:” epiphora refers then to the transfer of the common proper name of the thing to the new, unfamiliar, alien (allotrios) place or object. Furthermore, the transference (or substitution), borrowing as it does the alien name for the thing, does not disrupt the overall unity of meaning or logical order of correspondence within the denotative system; all such movement remains within the classifications of genus and species.

The metaphoric transfer of meaning will become a significant point of debate and speculation in later philosophical discussions. Although Aristotle himself does not explore the latent philosophical questions in his own theory, subsequent philosophers of language have over the years recast these issues, exploring the challenges to meaning, reference, and correspondence that present themselves in the substitution theory. What happens, on these various levels, when we substitute one object or descriptor of a “natural kind,” to a foreign object domain? It may the be the case that metaphorical transference calls into question the limits of all meaning-bearing categories, and in turn, the manner in which words can be said to “refer” to specific objects and their attributes. By virtue of the epiphoric movement, species and genus attributes of disparate objects fall into relations of kinship, opposition, or deviation among the various ontological categories. These relations allow for the metaphoric novelty which will subsequently fuel the development of alternative theories, those which view as fundamental to our cognitive or conceptual processes. At this point the analysis of metaphor opens up the philosophical space for further debate and interpretation.

b. The Philosophical Issues

In any theory of metaphor, there are significant philosophical implications for the transfer of meaning from one object-domain or context of associations to another. The metaphor, unlike its sister-trope the analogy, creates a new form of predication, suggesting that one category or class of objects (with certain characteristics) can be projected onto another separate class of entities; this projection may require a blurring of the ontological and epistemological distinctions between the kinds of objects that can be said to exist, either in the mind or in the external world. Returning to the Shakespearean metaphor above, what are the criteria that we use to determine whether a dying ember aptly fits the state of the narrator’s consciousness? What are the perceptual and ontological connections between fire and human existence? The first problem lies in how we are to explain the initial “fit” between any predicate category and its objects. Another problem comes to the forefront when we try to account for how metaphors enable us to think in new ways. If we are to move beyond the standard substitution model, we are compelled to investigate the specific mental operations that enable us to create metaphoric representations; we need to elaborate upon the processes which connect particular external objects (and their properties) given to sensory experience to linguistic signs “referring” to a new kind of object, knowledge context, or domain of experience.

According to the standard model, a metaphor’s ability to signify is restricted by ordinary denotation. The metaphor, understood as a new name, is conceived as a function of individual terms, rather than sentences or wider forms of discourse (narratives, texts). As Continental phenomenology develops in the late 19th and 20th centuries, we are presented with radically alternative theories which obscure strict boundaries between the literal and the figurative, disrupting the connections between perception, language, and thought. Namely, the phenomenological, interactionist, and cognitive treatments of metaphor defend the view that metaphorical language and symbol serve as indirect routes to novel ways of knowing and describing human experience. In their own ways, these theories will call into question the validity and usefulness of correspondence and reference, especially in theoretical disciplines such as philosophy, theology, literature, and science.

Although this article largely focuses on explicating phenomenological theories of metaphor, it should be noted that in all three theories mentioned above, metaphor is displaced from its formerly secondary position in substitution theory to occupying the front and center of our cognitive capabilities. Understood as the product of intentional structures in the mind, metaphor now becomes conceptual, rather than merely ornamental, acting as a conduit through which we take apart and re-assemble the concepts we use to describe the varieties and nuances of experience. They all share in the assumption that metaphors suggest, posit, or disclose similarities between objects and domains of experience (where there seem to be none), without explicitly recognizing that a comparison is being made between two sometimes very different kinds of things or events. These theories, when applied to our original metaphor (“in me thou seest…”) contend that at times, there need not be any explicit similarity between states of awareness or existence as “fire” or “ashes”.

c. Nietzsche’s Role in Development of Phenomenological Theories of Metaphor

In Nietzsche’s thought we see an early turning away from the substitution theory and its reliance on the correspondence theory of truth, denotation, and reference. His description of metaphor takes us back to its primordial “precognitive” or ontological origins; Nietzsche acts here as a pre-cursor to later developments, yet in itself his analysis offers a compelling account of the power of metaphor. Though his remarks on metaphor are somewhat scattered, they can be found in the early writings of 1872-74, Nachgelassene Fragmente, and “On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense” (see W. Kaufman’s translation in The Portable Nietzsche). Together with the “Rhetorik” lectures, these writings argue for a genealogical explanation of the conceptual, displacing traditional philosophical categories into the metaphorical realm. In doing so, he deconstructs our conventional reliance on the idea that meaningful language must reflect a system of logical correspondences.

With correspondence, we can only assume we are in possession of the truth when our representations or ideas about the world “match up” with external states of affairs. We have already seen how Aristotle’s system of first-order predication supports correspondence, as it is enabled through the denotative ascription of predicates/categorical features of /to objects. But Nietzsche boldly suggests that we are, from the outset, already in metaphor and he works from this starting point. The concepts and judgments we use to describe reality do not flatly reflect pre-existing similarities or causal relationships between themselves and our physical intuitions about reality, they are themselves metaphorical constructions; that is, they are creative forms of differentiation emerging out of a deeper undifferentiated primordiality of being. The truth of the world is more closely reflected in the Dionysian level of pure aesthetic immersion into an “undecipherable” innermost essence of things.

Even in his early work, The Birth of Tragedy, Nietzsche rejects the long-held assumption that truth is an ordering of concepts expressed through rigid linguistic categories, putting forth the alternative view which gives primacy to symbol as the purest, most elemental form of representation. That which is and must be expressed is produced organically, out of the flux of nature and yielding a “becoming” rather than being.

In the Dionysian dithyramb man is incited to the greatest exaltation of all his symbolic faculties; something never before experienced struggles for utterance—the annihilation of the veil of maya, … oneness as the soul of the race and of nature itself. The essence of nature is now to be expressed symbolically; we need a new world of symbols.… (BOT Ch. 2)

Here, following Schopenhauer, he reverses Aristotelian transference of concept-categories from the literal to the figurative, and makes the figurative the original mode for representation of experience. The class terms “species” and “genus”, based in Aristotle and so important in classical and medieval epistemology, only appear to originate and validate themselves in “dialectics and through scientific reflection.” For Nietzsche, the categories hide their real nature, abiding as frozen metaphors which reflect previously experienced levels of natural experience metaphorically represented in our consciousness. They emerge through construction indirectly based in vague images or names for things, willed into being out of the unnamed flowing elements of biological existence. Even Thales the pre-Socratic, we are reminded, in his attempt to give identity to the underlying unity of all things, falls back on a conceptualization of it as water without realizing he is using a metaphor.

Once we construct and begin to apply our concepts, their metaphorical origins are forgotten or concealed from ordinary awareness. This theoretical process is but another attempt to restore “the also-forgotten” original unity of being. The layering of metaphors, the archeological ancestors of concepts, is specifically linked to our immediate experiential capacity to transcend the proper and the individual levels of experience and linguistic signs. We cannot, argues Nietzsche, construct metaphors without breaking out of the confines of singularity, thus we must reject the artificiality of designating separate names for separate things. To assume that an individual name would completely and transparently describe its referent (in perception) is to also assume that language and external experience mirror one another in some perfect way. It is rather the case that language transfers meaning from place to place. The terms metapherein and Übertragung are equivalently applied here; if external experience is in constant flux, it is not possible to reduplicate exact and individual meanings. To re-describe things through metaphor is to “leave out” and “carry-over” meaning, to undergo a kind of dispossession of self, thing, place, and time and an overcoming of both individualisms and dualities. Thus the meaningful expression of the real is seen and experienced most directly in the endlessly creative activity of art and music, rather than philosophy.

2. The Phenomenological Theory in Continental Philosophy

Versions of Nietzsche’s “metaphorization” of thought will reappear in the Continental philosophers described below; those who owe their phenomenological attitudes to Husserl, but disagree with his transcendental idealization of meaning, one which demands that we somehow separate the world of experience from the essential meanings of objects in that world. Taken together, these philosophers call into question the position that truth entails a relationship of correspondence between dual aspects of reality, one internal to our minds and the other external. We consider Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida as the primary examples. For Heidegger, metaphoric language signals a totality or field of significance in which being discloses or reveals itself. Ricoeur’s work, in turn, builds upon aspects of Heidegger’s ontological hermeneutics, explicating how it is the case that metaphors drive speculative reflection. In Ricoeur’s model, the literal level is subverted, and metaphoric language and symbols containing “semantic kernels” create structures of double reference in all figurative forms of discourse. These structures point beyond themselves in symbols and texts, serving as mediums which reveal new worlds of meaning and existential possibilities.

French philosopher Jacques Derrida, on the other hand, reiterates the Nietzschean position; metaphor does not subvert metaphysics, but rather is itself the hidden source of all conceptual structures.

a. Phenomenological Method: Husserl

Edmund Husserl’s phenomenological method laid the groundwork, in the early 20th century, for what would eventually take shape in the phenomenological philosophies of Martin Heidegger, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, and Jean-Paul Sartre. Husserl’s early work provides the foundation for exploring how these modes of presentation convey the actual meaningful contents of experience. He means to address here the former distinction made by Kant between the phenomenal appearances of the real (to consciousness) and the noumenal reality of the things-in-themselves. Husserl, broadly speaking, seeks to resolve not only what some see as a problematic dualism in Kant, but also some philosophical problems that accompany Hegel’s constructivist phenomenology.

Taken in its entirety, Husserl’s project demonstrates a major shift in the 20th century phenomenology, seeking a rigorous method for the description and analysis of consciousness and the contents given to it. He intends his method to be the scientific grounding for philosophy; it is to be a critique of psychologism and a return to a universal knowledge of “the things themselves,” those intelligible objects apprehended by and given to consciousness.

In applying this method we seek, Husserl argues, a scientific foundation for universally objective knowledge; adhering to the “pure description” of phenomena given to consciousness through the perception of objects. If those objects are knowable, it is because they are immediate in conscious experience. It is through the thorough description of these objects as they appear to us in terms of color, shape, and so forth, that we apprehend that which is essential – what we call “essences” or meanings. Here, the act of description is a method for avoiding a metaphysical trap: that of imposing these essences or object meanings onto the contents of mental experience. Noesis, for Husserl, achieves its aim by including within itself (giving an account of) the role that context or horizon plays in delineating possible objects for experience. This will have important implications for later phenomenological theories of metaphor, in that metaphors may be said intend new figurative contexts in which being appears to us in new ways.

In Ideen (30), Husserl explains how such a horizon or domain of experience presents a set of criteria for us to apply. We choose and identify an object as a single member of a class of objects, and so these regions of subjective experience, also called regions of phenomena, circumscribe certain totalities or generic unities to which concrete items belong. In order to understand the phenomenological approach to meaning-making, it is first necessary to clarify what we mean by “phenomenological description,” as it is described in Logical Investigations. Drawing upon the work of Brentano and Meinong, Husserl develops a set of necessary structural relations between the knower (ego), the objects of experience, and the horizon within which those objects are given. The relation is characterized in an axiomatic manner as intentionality, where the subjective consciousness and its objects are correlates brought together in a psychological act. Subjectivity contributes to and makes possible cognition; specifically, it must be the case that perception and cognition are always about something given in the stream of consciousness, they are only possible because consciousness intends or refers to these immanent objects. As we shall presently see, the intentional nature of consciousness applies to Ricoeur’s hermeneutics of the understanding, bestowing metaphor with a special ability to expand (to nearly undermining) the structure of reference in a non-literal sense to an existential state.

Husserl’s stage like development of phenomenology unveils the structure of intentionality as derived from the careful description of certain mental acts. Communicable linguistic expressions, such as names and sentences, exist only in so far as they exhibit intentional meanings for speakers. Written or spoken expressions only carry references to objects because they have meanings for speakers and knowers. If we examine all of our mental perceptions, we find it impossible to think without intending an object of some sort. Both Continental and Anglo-American thinkers agree that metaphor holds the key to understanding these processes, as it re-organizes our senses of perception, temporality, and relation of subject to object, referring to these as subjects of existential concern and possibility.

b. Heidegger’s Contribution

Heidegger, building upon the phenomenological thematic, asserts that philosophical analysis should keep to careful description of the human encounter with the world, revealing the modes in which being is existentially or relationally given. This signals both a nod to and departure from Husserl, leading to a rethinking of phenomenology which replaces the theoretical apprehension of meaning with an “uncovering” of being as it is lived out in experiential contexts or horizons. Later, Ricoeur will draw on Heidegger’s “existentialized” intentionality as he characterizes the referential power of metaphors to signal those meanings waiting to be “uncovered’ by Dasein’s (human as being-there) experience of itself – in relation to others, and to alternate worlds of possibility.

As his student, Heidegger owes to Husserl the phenomenological intent to capture “the things themselves” (die Sachen selbst), however, the Heideggerian project outlined in Being and Time rejects the attempt to establish phenomenology as a science of the structures of consciousness and reforms it in ontologically disclosive or manifestational terms. Heidegger’s strong attraction to the hermeneutic tradition in part originates in his dialogue with Wilhem Dilthey, the 19th century thinker who stressed the importance of historical consciousness attitude in guiding the work of the social sciences and hermeneutics, directed toward the understanding of primordial experience. Dilthey’s influence on Heidegger and Ricoeur (as well as Gadamer) is evident, in that all recognize the historical life of humans as apprehended in the study of the text (a form of spirit), particularly those containing metaphors and narratives conveying a lived, concrete experience of religious life.

Heidegger rejects the notion that the structures of consciousness are internally maintained as transcendentally subjective and also directed towards their transcendental object. Phenomenology must now be tied to the problems of human existence, and must then direct itself immediately towards the lived world and allow this “beholding” of the world to guide the work of “its own uncovering.”

Heidegger argues for a return to the original Greek definitions of the terms phainonmenon (derived from phainesthai, or “that which shows itself”) and logos. Heidegger adopts these terms for his own purposes, utilizing them to reinforce the dependence of ontological disclosure or presence: those beings showing themselves or letting themselves be “seen-as.” The pursuit of aletheia, (“truth as recovering of the forgotten aspects of being”) is now fulfilled through adherence to a method of self-interpretation achieved from the standpoint of Dasein’s (humanity’s) subjectivity, which has come to replace the transcendental ego of Kant and Husserl.

The turn to language, in this case, must be more than simple communication between persons; it is a primordial feature of subjectivity. Language is to be the interpretive medium of the understanding through which all forms of being present themselves to subjective apprehension. In this way, Heidegger replaces the transcendental version of phenomenology with the disclosive, where the structure of interpretation provides further insight into his ontological purposes of the understanding.

3. Existential Phenomenology: Paul Ricoeur, Hermeneutics, and Metaphor

The linguistic turn in phenomenology has been most directly applied to metaphor in the works of Paul Ricoeur, who revisits Husserlian and Heideggerian themes in his extensive treatment of metaphor. He extends his analysis of metaphor into a fully developed discursive theory of symbol, focusing on those found in religious texts and sacred narratives. His own views follow from what he thinks are overly limited structuralist theories of symbol, which, in essence, do not provide a theory of linguistic reference useful for his own hermeneutic project. For Ricoeur, a proper theory of metaphor understands it to be “a re-appropriation of our effort to exist,” echoing Nietszche’s call to go back to the primordiality of being. Metaphor must then include the notion that such language is expressive and constitutive of the being of those who embark on philosophical reflection.

Much of Ricoeur’s thought can be characterized by his well-known statement “the symbol gives rise to the thought.” Ricoeur shares Heidegger’s and Husserl’s assumptions: we reflectively apprehend or grasp the structures of human experience as they are presented to temporalized subjective consciousness While the “pure” phenomenology of Husserl seeks a transparent description of experience as it is lived out in phases or moments, Ricoeur, also following Nietzsche, centers the creation of meaning in the existential context. The noetic act originates in the encounter with a living text, constituting “a horizon of possibilities,” for the meaning of existence, thus abandoning the search for essences internal to the objects we experience in the world.

His foundational work in The Symbolism of Evil and The Rule of Metaphor places the route to human understanding concretely, via symbolic expressions which allow for the phenomenological constitution, reflection, and re-appropriation of experience. These processes are enabled by the structure of “seeing-as,” adding to Heidegger’s insight with the metaphoric acting as a “refiguring” of that which is given to consciousness. At various points he enters into conversation with Max Black and Nelson Goodman, among others, who also recognize the cognitive contributions to science and art found in the models and metaphors. In Ricoeur’s case, sacred metaphors display the same second-order functions shared by those in the arts and sciences, but with a distinctively ontological emphasis: “the interpretation of symbols is worthy of being called a hermeneutics only insofar as it is a part of self-understanding and of the understanding of being” (COI 30).

In The Rule of Metaphor, Ricoeur, departing from Aristotle, locates the signifying power of metaphor primarily at the level of the sentence, not individual terms. Metaphor is to be understood as a discursive linguistic act which achieves its purpose through extended predication rather than simple substitution of names. Ricoeur, like so many language philosophers, argues that Aristotelian substitution is incomplete; it does not go far enough in accounting for the semantic, syntactic, logical, and ontological issues that accompany the creation of a metaphor. The standard substitution model cannot do justice to potential for metaphor create meaning by working in tandem with propositional thought-structures (sentences). To these ends, Ricoeur’s study in The Rule of Metaphor replaces substitution and strict denotative theories with a theory of language that works through a structure of double reference.

Taking his lead while diverging from Aristotle, Ricoeur reads the metaphorical transfer of a name as a kind of “category mistake” which produces an imaginative construction about the new way objects may be related to one another. He expands this dynamic of “meaning transfer” on to the level of the sentence, then text, enabling the production of a second-order discursive level of thinking whereby all forms of symbolic language become phenomenological disclosures of being.

The discussion begins with the linguistic movement of epiphora (transfer of names-predicates) taken from an example in Poetics. A central dynamic exists in transposing one term, with one set of meaning-associations onto another. Citing Aristotle’s own example of “sowing around a god-created flame,”

If A = light of the sun, B = action of the sun, C = grain, and D = sowing, then

B is to A, as D is to C

We see action of the sun is to light as sowing is to grain, however, B is a vague action term (sun’s action) which is both missing and implied; Ricoeur calls this a “nameless act” which establishes a similar relation to the object, sunlight, as sowing is to the grain. In this act the phenomenological space for the creation of new meaning is opened up, precisely because we cannot find a conventional word to take the place of a metaphorical word. The nameless act implies that the transfer of an alien name entails more than a simple substitution of concepts, and is therefore said to be logically disruptive.

a. The Mechanics of Conceptual Blending

The “nameless act” entails a kind of “cognitive leap:’’ since there is no conventional term for B, the act does not involve substituting a decorative term in its place. Rather, a new meaning association has been created through the semantic gap between the objects. The absence of the original literal term, the “semantic void”, cannot be filled without the creation of a metaphor which signals the larger discursive context of the sentence and eventually, the text. If, as above, the transfer of predicates (the sowing of grain as casting of flames) challenges the “rules” of meaning dictated by ostensive theory, we are forced to make a new connection where there was none, between the conventional and metaphorical names for the object. For Ricoeur, the figurative (sowing around a flame) acts as hermeneutic medium in that it negates and displaces the original term, signifying a “new kind of object” which is in fact a new form (logos) of being. The metaphorical statement allows us to say that an object is and is not what we usually call it. The sense-based aspect is then “divorced” from predication and subsequently, logos is emptied of its objective meaning; the new object may be meaningful but not clear under the conditions of strict denotation or natural knowledge.

We take note that the “new object” (theoretically speaking) has more than figurative existence; the newly formed subject-predicate relation places the copula at the center of the name-object (ROM 18). Ricoeur’s objective is to create a dialectically driven process which produces a new ‘object-domain’ or category of being. Following the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung, (through the aforementioned negation and displacement) the new name has opened up a new field of meaning to be re-appropriated into our reflective consciousness. This is how Ricoeur deconstructs first-order reference in order to develop an ontology of sacred language based on second-order reference.

We are led to the view that myths are modes of discourse whose meanings are phenomenological spaces of openness, creating a nearly infinite range of interpretations. Thus we see how metaphor enables being, as Aristotle notes, to “be said in many ways.”

Ricoeur argues that second-order discursivity “violates” the pre-existing first order of genus and species, in turn causing a kind of upheaval among further relations and rules set by the categories: namely subordination, coordination, proportionality or equality among object properties. Something of a unity of being remains, yet for Ricoeur this non-generic unity or enchainement, corresponds to a single generic context referring to “Being,” restricting the senses or applications of transferred predicates in the metaphoric context.

b. The Role of Kant’s Schematism in Conceptual Blending

The notion of a “non-generic unity” raises, perhaps, more philosophical problems than it answers. How are we to explain the mechanics which blend descriptors from one object domain and its sets of perceptions, to a domain of foreign objects? Ricoeur addresses the epistemic issues surrounding the transfer of names from one category to another in spatiotemporal experience by importing Kant’s theory of object construction, found in the Critique of Pure Reason. In the “Transcendental Schematism”, Kant establishes the objective validity of the conceptual categories we use to synthesize the contents of experience. In this section, Kant elevates the Aristotelian categories from grammatical principles to formal structures intrinsic to reason. Here, he identifies an essential problem for knowledge: how are we to conceive a relationship between these pure concept-categories of the understanding and the sensible objects given to us in space and time? With the introduction of the schematism, Kant seeks a resolution to the various issues inherent to the construction of mental representations (a position shared by contemporary cognitive scientists; see below). For Ricoeur, this serves to answer the problem of how metaphoric representations of reality can actually “refer” to reality (even if only at the existential level of experience).

Kant states “the Schematism” is a “sensible condition under which alone pure concepts of the understanding can be employed” (CPR/A 136). Though the doctrine is sometimes said to be notoriously confusing due to its circular nature, the schemata are meant as a distinctive set of mediating representations, rules, or operators in the mind which themselves display the universal and necessary characteristics of sensible objects; these characteristics are in turn synthesized and unified by the activity of the transcendental imagination.

In plainer terms, the schematic function is used by the imagination to guide it in the construction of images. It does not seem to be any kind of picture of an object, but rather the “form” or “listing” of how we produce the picture. For Ricoeur, the schematism lends the structural support for assigning an actual truth-value or cognitive contribution to the semantic innovation produced by metaphor. The construction of new meaning via new forms of predication entails a re-organization and re-interpretation of pre-existing forms, and the operations of the productive imagination enable the entire process.

In the work Figuring the Sacred, for example, Ricoeur, answering to his contemporary Mircea Eliade ( The Sacred and The Profane), moves metaphor beyond the natural “boundedness” of myths and symbols. While these manifest meaning, they are still constrained in that they must mirror the natural cosmic order of things. Metaphor, on the other hand, occupies the center of a “hermeneutic of proclamation;” it has the power to proclaim because it is a “free invention of discourse.” Ricoeur specifically explicates biblical parables, proverbs, and eschatological statements as extended metaphorical processes. Thus, “The Kingdom of God will not come with signs that you can observe. Do not say, ‘It is here; it is there.’ Behold the kingdom of God is among you” (Luke 17:20-21). This saying creates meaning by breaking down our ordinary or familiar temporal frameworks applied to interpretation of signs (of the kingdom). The quest for signs is, according to Ricoeur, “overthrown” for the sake of “a completely new existential signification” (FS 59).

This discussion follows from the earlier work in The Rule of Metaphor, where the mechanics of representation behind this linguistic act of “re-description” are further developed. The act points us towards a novel ontological domain of human possibility, enabled through new cognitive content. The linguistic act of creating a metaphor in essence becomes a hermeneutic act directed towards a gap which must be bridged, that between the abstract (considerations of reflection) understanding (Verstehen) and the finite living out of life. In this way Ricoeur’s theory, often contrasted with that of Derrida, takes metaphor beyond the mechanics of substitution.

4. Jacques Derrida: Metaphor as Metaphysics

In general, Derrida's deconstructive philosophy can be read as a radically alternative way of reading philosophical texts and arguments, viewing them in a novel way through the lens of a rhetorical methodology. This will amount to the taking apart of established ways in which philosophers define perception, concept formation, meaning, and reference.

Derrida, from the outset, will call into question the assumption that the formation of concepts (logos) somehow escapes the primordiality of language and the fundamentally metaphorical-mythical nature of philosophical discourse. In a move which goes much further than Ricoeur, Derrida argues for what Guiseseppe Stellardi so aptly calls the “reverse metaphorization of concepts.” The reversal is such that there can be no final separation between the linguistic-metaphorical and the philosophical realms. These domains are co-constitutive of one another, in the sense that either one cannot be fully theorized or made to fully or transparently explain the meaning of the other. The result is that language acquires a certain obscurity, ascendancy, and autonomy. It will permanently elude our attempts to fix its meaning-making activity in foundational terms which necessitate a transcendent or externalized (to language) unified being.

Derrida's White Mythology offers a penetrating critique of the common paradigm involving the nature of concepts, posing the following questions: “Is there metaphor in the text of philosophy, and if so, how?” Here, the history of philosophy is characterized as an economy, a kind of "usury" where meaning and valuation are understood as metaphorical processes involving “gain and loss.” The process is represented through Derrida’s well-known image of the coin:

I was thinking how the Metaphysicians, when they make a language for themselves, are like … knife-grinders, who instead of knives and scissors, should put medals and coins to the grindstone to efface … the value… When they have worked away till nothing is visible in these crown pieces, neither King Edward, the Emperor William, nor the Republic, they say: 'These pieces have nothing either English, German, or French about them; we have freed them from all limits of time and space; they are not worth five shillings any more ; they are of inestimable value, and their exchange value is extended indefinitely.’ (WM 210).

The “usury” of the sign (the coin) signifies the passage from the physical to the metaphysical. Abstractions now become “worn out” metaphors; they seem like defaced coins, their original, finite values now replaced by a vague or rough idea of the meaning-images that may have been present in the originals.

Such is the movement which simultaneously creates and masks the construction of concepts. Concepts, whose real origins have been forgotten, now only yield an empty sort of philosophical promise – that of “the absolute”, the universalized, unlimited “surplus value” achieved by the eradication of the sensory or momentarily given. Derrida reads this process along a negative Hegelian line: the metaphysicians are most attracted to “concepts in the negative, ab-solute, in-finite, non-Being” (WM 121). That is, their love of the most abstract concept, made that way “by long and universal use”, reveals a preference for the construction of a metaphysics of Being. This is made possible via the movement of the Hegelian Aufhebung. The German term refers to a dynamic of sublation where the dialectical, progressive movement of consciousness overcomes and subsumes the particular, concrete singularities of experience through successive moments of cognition. Derrida levels a strong criticism against Hegel’s attempts to overcome difference, arguing that consciousness as understood by Hegel takes on the quality of building an oppressive sort of narrative, subsuming the particular and the momentary under an artificial theoretical gaze. Derrida prefers giving theoretical privilege to the negative; that is, to the systematic negation of all finite determinations of meaning derived from particular aspects of particular beings.

Echoing Heidegger, Derrida conceives of metaphysical constructs as indicative of the Western "logocentric epoch" in philosophy. They depend for their existence on the machinery of binary logic. They remain static due to our adherence to the meaning of ousia (essence), the definition of being based on self-identitical substance, which can only be predicated or expressed in either/or terms. Reference to being, in this case, is constrained within the field of the proper and univocal. Both Heidegger and Derrida, and to some degree Ricoeur seek to free reference from these constraints. Unlike Heidegger, however, Derrida does not work from the assumption that being indicates some unified primordial reality.

For Derrida, there lies hidden within the merely apparent logical unity (with its attendant binary oppositions) or logocentricity of consciousness a white mythology, masking the primitive plurivocity of being which eludes all attempts to name it. Here we find traces of lost meanings, reminiscent of the lost inscriptions on coins. These are “philosophemes,” words, tropes or modes of figuration which do not express ideas or abstract representations of things (grounded in categories), but rather invoke a radically plurivocal notion of meaning. Having thus dismantled the logic of either/or with difference (difference), Derrida gives priority to ambiguity, in “both/and” and “neither/nor” modes of thought and expression. Meaning must then be constituted of and by difference, rather than identity, for difference subverts all preconceived theoretical or ontological structures. It is articulated in the context of all linguistic relations and involves ongoing displacement of a final idealized and unified form of meaning; such displacement reveals through hints and traces, the reality and experience of a disruptive alterity in meaning and being. Alterity is “always already there” by virtue of the presence of the Other.

With the introduction of “the white mythology,” Derrida’s alignment with Nietszche creates a strong opposition to traditional Western theoria. Forms of abstract ideation and theoretical systems representing the oppressive consciousness of the “white man,” built in the name of reason/logos, are in themselves a collection of analogies, existing as colorless dead metaphors whose primitive origins lie in the figurative realms of myths, symbol, and fable.

Derrida's project, resulting as it does in the deconstruction of metaphysics, runs counter to Ricoeur's tensive theory. In contrast to Heidegger’s restrained criticism Derrida’s deconstruction appears to Ricoeur “unbounded.” That is, Ricoeur still assumes a distinction between the speculative and the poetic, where the poetic “drives the speculative” to explicate a surplus of meaning. The surplus, or plurivocity is problematic from Derrida's standpoint. The latter argues that the theory remains logocentric in that it remains true to the binary mode of identity and difference which underlie metaphysical distinctions such as “being and non-being.” For Ricoeur, metaphors create a new space for meaning based on the tension between that which is (can be properly predicated of an object) and that which “is not” (which cannot be predicated of an object). Derrida begs to differ: in the final analysis, there can be no such separation, systematic philosophical theory or set of conceptual structures through which we subsume and “explain” the cognitive or existential value of metaphor.

Derrida's reverse metaphorization of concepts does not support a plurivocal characterization of meaning and being, it does not posit a wider referential field; for Derrida metaphors and concepts remain in a complex, always ambiguous relation to one another. Thus he seems to do away with “reference,” or the distinction between signifier and signified, moving even beyond polysemy (the many potential meaning that words carry). The point here is to preserve the flux of sense and the ongoing dissemination of meaning and otherness.

a. The Dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida

The dispute between Ricoeur and Derrida regarding the referential power of metaphor lies in where they position themselves with regard to Aristotle. Ricoeur's position, in giving priority to the noun-phrase instead of the singular name, challenges Aristotle while still appealing to the original taxonomy (categories) of being based on an architectonic system of predication. For Ricoeur, metaphoric signification mimics the fundamentally equivocal nature of being—we cannot escape the ontological implications of Aristotle’s statement: being can be “said in many ways.” Nevertheless, Ricoeur maintains the distinction between mythos and logos, for we need the tools provided by speculative discourse to explain the polysemic value of metaphors.

Derrida’s deconstruction reaches back to dismantle Aristotle's theory, rooted as it is in the ontology of the proper name/noun (onoma) which signifies a thing as self-identical being (homousion). This, states Derrida, “reassembles and reflects the culture of the West; the white man takes his own mythology, Indo-European mythology, his own logos, that is, the mythos of his idiom, for the universal form of that he must still wish to call Reason” (WM 213).

The original theory makes metaphor yet another link in the logocentric chain—a form of metaphysical oppression. If the value of metaphor is restricted to the transference of names, then metaphor entails a loss or negation of the literal which is still under the confines of a notion of discourse which upholds the traditional formulations of representation and reference in terms of the mimetic and the “proper” which are, in turn, based on a theory of perception (and an attendant metaphysics) that gives priority to resemblance, identity, or what we can call “the law of the same.”

5. Anglo-American Philosophy: Interactionist Theories

Contemporary phenomenological theories of metaphor directly challenge the straightforward theory of reference, replacing the ordinary propositional truth based on denotation with a theory of language which designates and discloses its referents. These interactionist theories carry certain Neo-Kantian features, particularly in the work of the analytic philosophers Nelson Goodman and Max Black. They posit the view that metaphors can reorganize the connections we make between our perceptions of the world. Their theories reflect certain phenomenological assumptions about the ways in which figurative language expands the referential field, allowing for the creation of novel meanings and creating new possibilities for constructing models of reality; in moving between the realms of art and science, metaphors have an interdisciplinary utility. Both Goodman and Black continue to challenge the traditional theory of linguistic reference, offering instead the argument that reference is enabled by the manipulation of predicates in figurative modes of thinking through language.


6. Metaphor, Phenomenology, and Cognitive Science

Recent studies underscore the connections between metaphors, mapping, and schematizing aspects of cognitive organization in mental life. Husserl’s approach to cognition took an anti-naturalist stance, opposed to defining consciousness as an objective entity and therefore unsuited to studying the workings of subjective consciousness; instead his phenomenological stance gave priority to subjectivity, since it constitutes the necessary set of pre-conditions for knowing anything at all as an object or a meaning. Recently, the trend has been renewed and phenomenology has made some productive inroads into the examination of connectionist and embodied approaches to perception, cognition and other sorts of dynamic and adaptive (biological) systems.

Zahavi and Thompson, for example, see strong links between Husserlian phenomenology and philosophy of mind with respect to the phenomena of consciousness, where the constitutive nature of subjective consciousness is clarified specifically in terms of the forms and relations of different kinds of intentional mental states. These involve the unity of temporal experience, the structural relations between intentional mental acts and their objects, and the inherently embodied nature of cognition. Those who study the embodied mind do not all operate in agreement with traditional phenomenological assumptions and methods. Nevertheless, some “naturalized” versions in the field of consciousness studies are now gaining ground, offering viable solutions to the kind of problematic Cartesian dualistic metaphysics that Husserl’s phenomenology suggests.

a. The Embodied Mind

In recent years, the expanding field of cognitive science has explored the role of metaphor in the formation of consciousness (cognition and perception). In a general sense, it appears that contemporary cognitivist, constructivist, and systems (as in self-organizing) approaches to the study of mind incorporate metaphor as a tool for developing an anti-metaphysical, anti-positivist theory of mind, in an attempt to reject any residual Cartesian and Kantian psychologies. The cognitive theories, however, remain partially in debt to Kantian schematism and its role in cognition.

There is furthermore in these theories an overturning of any remaining structuralist suppositions (that language and meaning might be based on autonomous configurations of syntactic elements). Many cognitive scientists, in disagreement with Chomsky’s generative grammar, study meaning as a form of cognition that is activated in context of use. Lakoff and Johnson, in Philosophy in the Flesh, find a great deal of empirical evidence for the ways in which metaphors shape our ordinary experience, exploring the largely unconscious perceptual and linguistic processes that allow us to understand one idea or domain of experience, both conceptual and physical, in terms of a “foreign” domain. The research follows the work of Srini Narayanan and Eleanor Rosch, cognitive scientists who also examine schemas and metaphors as key in embodied theories of cognition. Such theories generally trace the connective interplay between our neuronal makeup, or physical interactions with the environment, and our own private and social human purposes.

In a limited sense, the stress on the embodied nature of cognition aligns itself with the phenomenological position. Perceptual systems, built in physical response to determinate spatio-temporal and linguistic contexts, become phenomenological “spaces” shaped through language use. Yet these researchers largely take issue with Continental phenomenology and traditional philosophy in a dramatic and far-reaching way, objecting to the claim that the phenomenological method of introspection makes adequate space for our ability to survey and describe all available fields of consciousness in the observing subject. If it is the case that we do not fully access the far reaches of hidden cognitive processes, much of the metaphorical mapping which underlies cognition takes place at an unconscious level, which is sometimes referred to as “the cognitive unconscious.”(PIF 12-15)

Other philosophers of mind, including Stefano Arduini, and Antonio D’Amasio, work along similar lines in cognitive linguistics, cognitive science, neuroscience, and artificial intelligence. Their work investigates the ways in which metaphors ground various first and second-order cognitive and emotional operations and functions. Their conclusions share insights with the Continental studies conceiving of metaphor as a “refiguring” of experience. There is then some potential for overlap with this cognitive-conceptual version of metaphor, where metaphors and schemata embody emergent transformative categories enabling the creation of new fields of cognition and meaning.

Arduini, in his work, has explored what he calls the “anthropological ability” to build up representations of the world. Here rhetorical figures are realized on the basis of conceptual domains which create the borders of experience. We have access to a kind of reality that would otherwise be indeterminate, for human beings have the ability to conceptualize the world in imaginative terms through myth, symbol, the unconscious, or any expressive sign. For Arduini, figurative activity does not depict the given world, but allows for the ability to construct world images employed in reality. To be figuratively competent is to use the imagination as a tool which puts patterns together in inventive mental processes. Arduini then seems to recall Nieztsche; anthropologically speaking, humans are always engaging in some form of figuration or form of language, which allows for “cognitive competence” in that it chooses among particular forms which serve to define the surrounding contexts or environments. Again, metaphor is foundational to the apprehension of reality; it is part of the pre-reflective or primordial apparatus of experience, perception, and first- through second-order thought, comprising an entire theoretical approach as well as disciplines such as evolutionary anthropology (see Tooby and Cosmides).

b. The Literary Mind

The work of Gilles Fauconnier and Mark Turner extends that of Lakoff and Johnson outlined above. For Fauconnier, the task of language is to construct, and for the linguist and cognitive scientist it is “a window into the mind.” Independently and together, Fauconnier and Turner’s collaboration results in a theory of conceptual blending in which metaphorical forms take center stage. Basically, the theory of conceptual blending follows from Lakoff and Johnson’s work on the “mapping” or projective qualities of our cognitive faculties. For example, if we return to take Shakespearean line “in me thou seest the glowing of such fire”, the source is fire, whose sets of associations are projected onto the target – in this case the waning aspect of the narrator. Their research shows that large numbers of such cross-domain mappings are expressed as conceptual structures which have propositional content: for example, “life is fire, loss is extinction of fire.” There exist several categories of mappings across different conceptual domains, including spatio-temporal orientation, movement, and containment. For example: “time flies” or “this relationship is smothering.”

Turner’s work in The Literary Mind, takes a slightly different route, portraying these cognitive mechanisms as forms of “storytelling.” This may, superficially, seem counterintuitive to the ordinary observer, but Turner gives ample evidence for the mind’s ability to do much of its everyday work using various forms of narrative projection (LM 6-9). It is not too far a reach from this version of narrative connection back to the hermeneutic and cognitive-conceptual uses of metaphor outlined earlier. If we understand parables to be essentially forms of extended metaphor, we can clearly see the various ways in which they contribute to the making of intelligible experience.

The study of these mental models sheds light on the phenomenological and hermeneutic aspects of reality-construction. If these heuristic models are necessary to cognitive functioning, it is because they allow us to represent higher-order aspects of reality which involve expressions of human agency, intentionality, and motivation. Though we may be largely unaware of these patterns, they are based on our ability to think in metaphor, are necessary, and are continuously working to enable the structuring of intentional experience – which cannot always be adequately represented by straightforward first-order physical description. Fauconnier states:

We see their status as inventions by contrasting them with alternative representations of the world. When we watch someone sitting down in a chair, we see what physics cannot recognize: an animate agent performing an intentional act. (MTL 19-20)

Turner, along with Fauconnier and Lakoff, connects parabolic thought with the image-schematic or mapping between different domains of encounter with our environments. Fauconnier’s work, correlating here with Turner’s, moves between cognitive-scientific and phenomenological considerations; both depict mapping as a constrained form of projection, a complex mental manipulation which moves across mental structures which correspond to various phenomenological spaces of thought, action, and communication.

Metaphorical mapping allows the mind to cross and conflate several domains of experience. The cross-referencing, reminiscent of Black’s interactionist dynamics, amounts to a form of induction resulting from projected relations between a source structure, a pattern we already understand, onto a target structure, that which we seek to understand.

Mapping as a form of metaphoric construction leads to other forms of blending, conceptual integration, and novel category formation. We can, along with Fauconnier and the rest, describe this emergent evolution of linguistic meaning in dialectical terms, arguing that it is possible to mesh together two images of virus (biological and computational) into a third integrated idea that integrates and expands the meaning of the first two (MTL 22). Philosophically speaking, we seem to have come full circle back to the Hegelian theme which runs through the phenomenological analysis of metaphor as a re-mapping of mind and reality.

7. Conclusion

The Continental theories of metaphor that have extrapolated and developed variations on the theme expressed in Nietzsche’s apocryphal pronouncement that truth is “a mobile army of metaphors.” The notion that metaphorical language is somehow ontologically and epistemologically prior to ordinary propositional language has since been voiced by Heidegger, Ricoeur, and Derrida. For these thinkers metaphor serves as a foundational heuristic structure, one which is primarily designed to subvert ordinary reference and in some way dismantle the truth-bearing claims of first-order propositional language. Martin Heidegger’s existential phenomenology does away with the assumption that true or meaningful intentional statements reflect epistemic judgments about the world; that is, they do not derive referential efficacy through the assumed correspondence between an internal idea and an external object. While there may be a kind of agreement between our notions of things and the world in which we find those things, it is still a derivative agreement emerging from a deeper ontologically determined set of relations between things-in-the-world, given or presented to us as inherently linked together in particular historical, linguistic, or cultural contexts.

The role of metaphor in perception and cognition also dominates the work of contemporary cognitive scientists, linguists, and those working in the related fields of evolutionary anthropology and computational theory. While the latter may not be directly associated with Continental phenomenology, aspects of their work support an “anti-metaphysical” position and draw upon common phenomenological themes which stress the embodied, linguistic, contextual, and symbolic nature of knowledge. Thinkers and researchers in this camp argue that metaphoric schemas are integral to human reasoning and action, in that they allow us to develop our cognitive and heuristic capacities beyond simple and direct first order experience.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Categories and De Interpretatione. J.C. Ackrill, trans. Oxford, Clarendon, 1963. (CDI)
  • Aristotle. Peri Hermenenias. Hans Arens, trans. Philadelphia, Benjamins, 1984. (PH)
  • Arduini, Stefano (ed.). Metaphors. Edizioni Di Storia E Letteratura,
  • Barber, A. and Stainton, R. The Concise Encyclopedia of Language and Linguistics.
  • Oxford, Elsevier Ltd., 2010
  • Black, Max. Models and Metaphors. Ithaca, Cornell, 1962. (MAM)
  • Brentano, Franz C. On the Several Senses of Being in Aristotle. Berkeley, UC Press, 1975.
  • Cazeaux, Clive. Metaphor and Continental Philosophy, from Kant to Derrida. London, Routledge, 2007.
  • Cooper, David E. Metaphor. London, Oxford, 1986.
  • Derrida, Jacques. “White Mythology, Metaphor in the Text of Philosophy” in Margins of Philosophy, trans. A. Bass, Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 1982. (WM)
  • Fauconnier, Gilles. Mappings in Thought and Language. Cambridge, Cambridge University, 1997. (MTL)
  • Gallagher, Shaun. Phenomenology and Non-reductionist Cognitive Science” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science. ed. by Shaun Gallagher and Daniel Schmicking. Springer, New York, 2010.
  • Goodman, Nelson. Languages of Art. New York, Bobs-Merrill, 1968.
  • Hinman, Lawrence. “Nietzsche, Metaphor, and Truth” in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 43, #2, 1984.
  • Harnad, Stevan. “Category Induction and Representation” in Categorical Perception: The Groundwork of Cognition. New York, Cambridge, 1987.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. John MacQuarrie and E. Robinson, trans. New York,
  • Harper and Row, 1962. (BT)
  • Heidegger, Martin. The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, trans. A. Hofstadter, Bloomington, Indiana University Press, 1982.
  • Huemer, Wolfgang. The Constitution of Consciousness: A Study in Analytic Phenomenology. Routledge, 2005.
  • Johnson, Mark. “Metaphor and Cognition” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science, ed. by Shaun Gallagher and Daniel Schmicking. Springer, New York, 2010.
  • Joy, Morny. “Derrida and Ricoeur: A Case of Mistaken Identity” in The Journal of Religion. Vol. 68, #04, University of Chicago Press, 1988.
  • Kant, Immanuel. The Critique of Pure Reason. Trans. N. K. Smith, New York, 1958. (CPR)
  • Kofman, Sarah, Nietzsche and Metaphor. Trans. D. Large, Stanford, 1993.
  • Lakoff, George and Johnson, Mark. Philosophy in the Flesh: The Embodied Mind and Its Challenge to Western Thought. New York, Perseus-Basic, 1999.
  • Malabou, Catharine. The Future of Hegel: Plasticity, Temporality, and the Dialectic. Trans. Lisabeth During, New York, Routledge, 2005.
  • Nietzsche, F. The Birth of Tragedy and the Case of Wagner. Trans. W. Kaufman. New York, Vintage, 1967. (BOT)
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Imagination and Chance: The Difference Between the Thought of Ricoeur and Derrida. Albany, SUNY Press, 1992
  • Mohanty, J.N. and McKenna, W.R. Husserl’s Phenomenology; A Textbook. Washington, DC, University Press, 1989.
  • Rajan, Tilottama. Deconstruction and the Remainders of Phenomenology: Sartre, Derrida, Foucault, Baudrillard. Stanford, Stanford University Press, 2002.
  • Ricoeur, Paul. Figuring the Sacred, trans. D. Pellauer, Minneapolis, Fortress, 1995. (FS)
  • Ricoeur, Paul. The Rule of Metaphor. Toronto, University of Toronto, 1993. (ROM)
  • Schrift Alan D. and Lawlor, Leonard (eds.) TheHistory of Continental Philosophy; Vol. 4 Phenomenology: Responses and Developments. Chicago, University of Chicago Press, 2010.
  • Stellardi, Giuseppe. Heidegger and Derrida on Philosophy and Metaphor: Imperfect Thought. New York, Humanity-Prometheus, 2000.
  • Tooby, J. and L. Cosmides (ed. with J.Barkow). The Adapted Mind: Evolutionary Psychology and The Generation of Culture. Oxford, 1992.
  • Turner, Mark. The Literary Mind: The Origins of Thought and Language. Oxford, 1996. (LM)
  • Woodruff-Smith, David and McIntyre, Ronald. Husserl and Intentionality: A Study of Mind, Meaning, and Language. Boston, 1982.
  • Zahavi, Dan. “Naturalized Phenomenology” in Handbook of Phenomenology and Cognitive Science.


Author Information

S. Theodorou
Immaculata University
U. S. A.

Willard Van Orman Quine: The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

quine1Willard Van Orman Quine was one of the most well-known American “analytic” philosophers of the twentieth century. He made significant contributions to many areas of philosophy, including philosophy of language, logic, epistemology, philosophy of science, and philosophy of mind/psychology (behaviorism). However, he is best known for his rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction. Technically, this is the distinction between statements true in virtue of the meanings of their terms (like “a bachelor is an unmarried man”) and statements whose truth is a function not simply of the meanings of terms, but of the way the world is (such as, “That bachelor is wearing a grey suit”). Although a contentious thesis, analyticity has been a popular explanation, especially among empiricists, both for the necessity of necessary truths and for the a priori knowability of some truths. Thus, in some contexts “analytic truth,” “necessary truth,” and “a priori truth” have been used interchangeably, and the analytic/synthetic distinction has been treated as equivalent to the distinctions between necessary and contingent truths, and between a priori and a posteriori (or empirical) truths. Empirical truths can be known only by empirical verification, rather than by “unpacking” the meanings of the terms involved, and are usually thought to be contingent.

Quine wrestled with the analytic/synthetic distinction for years, but he did not make his thoughts public until 1950, when he delivered his paper, “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” at a meeting of the American Philosophical Association. In this paper, Quine argues that all attempts to define and understand analyticity are circular. Therefore, the notion of analyticity should be rejected (along with, of course, the spurious distinction in which it features). This rejection has inspired debates and discussions for decades. For one thing, if Quine is right, and there are no truly necessary truths (that is, analytic truths), metaphysics, which traffics in such truths, is effectively dead.

Quine is generally classified as an analytic philosopher (where this sense of “analytic” has little to do with the analytic/synthetic distinction) because of the attention he pays to language and logic. He also employed a “naturalistic” method, which generally speaking, is an empirical, scientific method. A metaphysical approach was not an option for Quine, primarily because of his thoughts on analyticity.

Both because of the influence of “The Two Dogmas of Empircism” in analytic circles,  and because its perspective on analyticity is foundational to every other aspect of Quine’s thought—to his philosophies of language and logic, to his naturalistic epistemology, and to his anti-metaphysical stance—a survey of Quine’s thought on analyticity is perhaps the best introduction to his thought as a whole.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Influences
  2. The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction: A Focus on Analyticity
  3. Metaphysics: Some Implications
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Influences

Willard Van Orman Quine was born on June 25, 1908 in Akron Ohio. As a teenager, he was an avid stamp collector and a budding cartographer. One of his first publications was a free-hand map of the Portage Lakes of Ohio, which he sold for pennies to lakefront stores. When he was sixteen, Quine wrote the first edition of O.K. Stamp News, which was distributed to stamp collectors and dealers. Quine went on to write and distribute six more editions of the philatelic newspaper before moving on to new interests. One of these interests included active participation in the lighthearted “Greeter Club,” where members were required to call each other by their middle names (and engage in other sorts of playful word games). At this point, Quine became known as “Van” to his friends, a moniker that stuck with him for the rest of his life.

Quine received his undergraduate degree from OberlinCollege, in Oberlin, Ohio. He majored in mathematics with honors in mathematical philosophy and mathematical logic. During his college years, along with cultivating his interest in mathematics, mathematical logic, linguistics and philosophy, Quine began his secondary career as an intrepid traveler. He hitchhiked to, at least, Virginia, Kentucky, Canada and Michigan. In 1928, he made his way to Denver and back with a few friends, hopping freight trains, hitchhiking, and riding on running boards. Lodging often included jail houses (where one could sleep for free in relative safety), park benches and the ground. At the end of his junior year, he traveled to Europe. Quine writes in his autobiography, The Time of My Life: “An interest in foreign languages, like an interest in stamps, accorded with my taste for geography. Grammar, moreover, appeals to the same sense that is gratified by mathematics, or by the structure of boundaries and road networks” (Quine, 1987: 38).

During his junior year at Oberlin, Quine became immersed in Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica. Whitehead was a member of Harvard’s Philosophy Department, so Quine decided to apply to their doctoral program in philosophy. Graduating from Oberlin with an A- average, he was accepted, and received his Ph.D. in 2 years, at age twenty-three. Broadly speaking, his thesis sought to extensionalize the properties that populated the Principia. For our purposes, we may understand an extensional definition as a set of particular things. For instance, the extensional definition of a cat would consist of the set of all cats and the extensional definition of the property orange would consist of the set of all orange things (which could include things that are only partly orange). In Quine’s dissertation, we see his first concerted effort to do away with definitions that are not extensional, that is, with intensional definitions. Intensional definitions are, broadly speaking, generalizations, where particular things (for example, particular cats) are not employed in the definition. For instance, the intensional definition of a cat might be something like “four-legged feline mammal,” and likewise, the intensional definition of the property “orange” might be “a color that is the combination of yellow and red.” To some degree, Quine’s distaste for intensional definitions is rooted in Berkeley and Hume; also see the article on “the Classical theory of Concepts,” section 2 ). Generally speaking, Quine thought that intensional definitions, and likewise, “meanings” were vague, mentalistic entities; out of touch with the concrete particulars that comprise extensional definitions.

Quine’s use/mention distinction also first saw the light of day in his dissertation. This distinction underlines the difference between objects and names of objects. For instance, an actual cat, say Hercules the cat, is to be distinguished from the name ‘Hercules’. Quine uses single quotation marks to denote a name. Thus, Hercules the cat is orange and white, but the name ‘Hercules’ is not. Rather, the name ‘Hercules’ has other properties, for example, it begins with the letter ‘H’.  An actual object (for example, Hercules the cat) is mentioned, and we use a name (that is, ‘Hercules’) to do so.

After completing his dissertation in 1932, Quine was awarded a Sheldon Traveling Fellowship by Harvard. Taking the advice of Hebert Feigl and John Cooley, Quine, along with his first wife Naomi Clayton, set off for Europe to study with Rudolf Carnap. This would prove to be a momentous trip; Carnap had a singular and lasting influence on Quine. For although he initially agreed with much of what Carnap had to say, a number of Quine’s most distinctive ideas emerged as a result of rejecting some of Carnap’s more fundamental positions. Of particular importance is Quine’s rejection of the distinction between analytic and synthetic statements. Although the analytic/synthetic distinction had been a staple of the empiricist tradition since at least Hume, Quine was especially concerned with Carnap’s formulation of it.

2. The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction: A Focus on Analyticity

As Quine understood it (via Carnap), analytic truths are true as a result of their meaning. For instance, the statement “All bachelors are unmarried men” is true because being a “bachelor” means being an “unmarried man.” “Synthetic” claims on the other hand, are not true merely because of the meaning of the words used in the statement. Rather, the truth of these statements turns on facts. For instance, the claim “David is a bachelor” is only true if, in fact, David is a bachelor.

But before rejecting the analytic/synthetic distinction, Quine delivered three papers on Carnap to Harvard’s Society of Fellows in 1934, where he seemed to defend the distinction. They were titled: "The a priori," "Syntax," and "Philosophy as Syntax." Eager to get Carnap's work on the English-speaking philosophical stage, Quine delivered these lectures not only to give a clear and careful exposition of Carnap's new book, The Logical Syntax of Language, but to help convince the Harvard University that it needed Carnap (Carnap served as a visiting Professor at Harvard in 1940-41, but otherwise remained at the University of Chicago from 1936-1952.) Not only was Quine reading Carnap's work at this time, but Carnap was reading Quine's recent book, A System of Logistic, the published rewrite of his dissertation (Creath 1990: 149 – 160, # 15-17). Quine's respect for Carnap at this time is indisputable; a rapport had grown between the two such that they could easily exchange ideas and, for the most part, understand each other. Yet some sixty years after he gave the 1934 Harvard lectures, Quine confesses that they were rather servile reconstructions of Carnap’s thoughts, or as Quine puts it, they were "abjectly sequacious" (Quine, 1991: 266). For as early as 1933—a year before the Harvard lectures were delivered—Quine was having serious doubts about the analytic/synthetic distinction, doubts that he privately expressed to Carnap. For instance, on March 31, 1933, Carnap observes that "He [Quine] says after some reading of my "Syntax" MS [that is, the manuscript of Carnap’s The Logical Syntax of Language]: Is there a difference between logical axioms and empirical sentences? He thinks not. Perhaps I seek a distinction just for its utility, but it seems he is right: gradual difference: they are sentences we want to hold fast" (Quine, 1991:  267). Here, in the course of reading a draft of Carnap’s book in 1933, Quine questions the distinction between “logical axioms” and “empirical axioms,” where, generally speaking, “analytic” propositions entail logical axioms.

Almost twenty years later, Quine defended a variant of this position in his now famous paper, “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism.” Here, he claims that there is no sharp distinction between claims that are true in virtue of their meaning (analytic claims) and empirical claims (claims that may be verified by facts). In December 1950, Quine presented “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” to the philosophers gathered at the annual meeting of the American Philosophical Association (APA). This marked his public rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction. But as we saw above, Quine had been brooding over the matter since at least 1933. Not only did his qualms about this distinction surface in his discussions and correspondence with Carnap but also in conversation with other prominent philosophers and logicians, for example, Alfred Tarski, Nelson Goodman, and Morton White (Quine, 1987: 226). Stimulated by these conversations, White wrote his often overlooked paper, “The Analytic and the Synthetic: An Untenable Dualism,” which was published before Quine presented the “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” at the 1950 APA meeting (Quine footnotes this paper at the end of the published version “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism”).

Quine begins “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” by defining an analytic proposition as one that is "true by virtue of meanings" (Quine, 1980: 21). The problem with this characterization, he explains, is that the nature of meanings is obscure; Quine reminds the reader of what he takes to be one of Carnap's biggest mistakes in semantics—meaning is not to be confused with naming. For instance, the clause “The Morning Star” has a different meaning than the clause “The Evening Star” but both name the same object (the planet Venus), and thus, both have the same reference. Similarly, Quine explains that one mustn't confuse the meaning, that is, the “intension,” of a general term with its extension, that is, the class of particular things to which the term applies. For instance, he points out, the two general terms "creature with a heart" and "creature with a kidney" both have the same extension because every creature with a heart has a kidney, and likewise. But these two statements clearly don't have the same meaning. Thus, for Quine there is a clear distinction between intensions and extensions, which reflects an equally clear distinction between meanings and references.

Quine then briefly explains the notion of what a word might mean, as opposed to what essential qualities an object denoted by that word might be said to have. For instance, the object man might be said to be essentially rational, while being, say, “two-legged” is an accidental property—there are plenty of humans who only have one leg, or who have no legs at all. As a result, the word ‘man’ must mean, at least “a rational being,” but it does not necessarily mean “two-legged.” Thus, Quine concludes, there seems to be some kind of parallel between the essential properties of an object and the meaning of the word that denotes that object. Or as Quine puts it: "meaning is what essence becomes when it is divorced from the object of reference and wedded to the word" (Quine, 1980: 22).

But does this imply that meanings are some kind of “objects?” This can’t be the case, Quine concludes, because he just showed that meanings must not be confused with objects, that is, meanings must not be confused with references (for example, we must not confuse the meaning of the phrase “morning star” with what the phrase names, that is, the object Venus). Instead, it seems we should focus on grasping what is happening when two words are “synonymous,” that is, what seems to be happening when two words are “analytically” related. For instance, the two words ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried’ seem to be synonymous, and thus, the proposition, “All bachelors are unmarried men” seems to be an analytic statement. And thus Quine writes: “The problem of analyticity confronts us anew” (Quine, 1980: 22).

To tackle the notion of analyticity, Quine makes a distinction between two kinds of analytic claims, those comprised of logical truths and those comprised of  synonymous terms. Logical truths, Quine explains, are any statements that remain true no matter how we interpret the non-logical particles in the statement. Logical particles are logical operators, for example, not, if then, or, all, no, some, and so forth. For instance, the statement “No not-X is X” will remain true no matter how we interpret X, for example, “No not-cat is a cat,” or “No not-bicycle is a bicycle.” An example of the second kind of analytic statement would be, Quine explains, “No bachelor is married,” where the meaning of the word ‘bachelor’ is synonymous with the meaning of the word ‘unmarried.’ However, we can make this kind of analytic claim into a logical truth (as defined above) by replacing ‘bachelor’ with its synonym, that is, ‘unmarried man,’ to get “No unmarried man is married,” which is an instance of No not-X is X. However, to make this substitution, we had to have some idea of what is meant by the word ‘synonymy,’ but this is problematical, so the notion of synonymy is the focus of the remainder of his discussion of analyticity.

Quine suggests that one might, as is often done, appeal to definitions to explain the notion of synonymy. For instance, we might say that  “bachelor” is the definition of an “unmarried man,”  and thus, synonymy turns on definitions. However, Quine attests, in order to define “bachelor” as unmarried, the definer must possess some notion of synonymy to begin with. In fact, Quine writes, the only kind of definition that does not presuppose the notion of synonymy, is the act of ascribing an abbreviation purely conventionally. For instance, let’s say that I create a new word, ‘Archon.’ I can arbitrarily say that its abbreviation is “Ba2.”   In the course of doing so, I did not have to presuppose that these two notions are “synonymous;” I merely abbreviated ‘Archon’ by convention, by stipulation. However, when I normally attempt to define a notion, for example, “bachelor,” I must think to myself something like, “Well, what does it mean to be a bachelor, particularly, what words have the same meaning as the word ‘bachelor?’” that is, what meanings are synonymous with the meaning of the word ‘bachelor?’ And thus, Quine complains: "would that all species of synonymy were as intelligible [as those created purely by convention]. For the rest, definition rests on synonymy rather than explaining it" (Quine, 1980: 26).

Perhaps then, Quine suggests, one could define synonymy in terms of "interchangability." Two words are synonymous if they are "[interchangeable] in all contexts without change of truth value" (Quine, 1980: 27)\. However, this is problematic as well. Consider, Quine explains, the sentence “’Bachelor’ has less than ten letters.” If we simply exchange the word ‘bachelor’ with the words ‘unmarried man’ we have created a false statement, that is, “‘Unmarried man’ has less than ten letters.”  We also have problems if we try to replace the word ‘bachelor’ with ‘unmarried man’ in phrases like ‘bachelor of arts,’ or ‘bachelor’s buttons.’ But, Quine explains, we can get around the latter problem if we say that ‘bachelor of arts’ is a complete word, and thus, the ‘bachelor’ part of this word is merely a word-fragment, which cannot be interchanged with a complete word, for example, ‘bachelor’ when not understood as part of a phrase.

Regardless of this quick fix, what we are really after is “cognitive synonymy,” which is to be distinguished from the word-play discussed above. However, Quine is not quite sure what cognitive synonymy entails. But, he reminds us, we do know that “the sort of synonymy needed … [is] merely such that any analytic statement [can] be turned into a logical truth by putting synonyms for synonyms.” (Quine, 1980: 22). Recall, for instance, our example regarding “No not-X is an X.” In this case, we saw that  for example, “No bachelor is married” is in fact, an instance of the logical truth, No not-X is an X, particularly, “No unmarried man is a married man,” if, in fact, the words ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried man’ are synonymous. Thus, what we are looking for is this kind of synonymy; this is “cognitive synonymy.” However, in order to explain “cognitive synonymy”—as we just did—we had to assume that we knew what analyticity meant. In particular, we had to assume the meanings of the two kinds of analyticity explained above, that is, analyticity qua logical axioms and analyticity qua synonymy. And thus, Quine writes: “What we need is an account of cognitive synonymy not presupposing analyticity.” (Quine, 1980: 29). So, the question is, can we give an account of cognitive synonymy by appealing to interchangeability (recall that this is the task at hand) without presupposing any definition of analyticity?

Yes, initially it seems that one could, if our language contained the word “necessarily.” However, it turns out that the kind of “necessary” we have to assume may only apply to analytic statements, and thus, we once again presuppose a notion of analyticity to explain cognitive synonymy. Generally speaking, this plays out as follows: Assume that (1) “Necessarily all and only bachelors are bachelors.” (Quine, 1980: 29). That is, the word ‘necessary’ implies that this claim is logically true, and thus, it is analytic. Thus, if we assume that the words ‘bachelor’ and ‘unmarried man’ are interchangeable (in regard to meaning, not letters), then (2) “Necessarily all and only bachelors are unmarried men” is true, where once, again, the word ‘necessary’ seems to make this logically, that is, analytically true. And thus, once again, we needed to presuppose a notion of analyticity to define cognitive synonymy; “To suppose that [‘necessary’ makes sense] is to suppose that we have already made satisfactory sense of ‘analytic’” (Quine, 1980: 30).

Quine’s final proposal to define analyticity without an appeal to meaning—and thus without appeal to synonymy or definitions as follows: We can try to assimilate a natural language to a formal language by appealing to the semantical rules developed by Carnap (see the article on Rudolf Carnap, sections 3-6). However, Quine finds the same kind of circularity here that he has found elsewhere. To show why, Quine reconstructs a general Carnapian paradigm regarding artificial languages and semantical rules, that, broadly speaking, proceeds as follows:

[1] Assume there is an artificial language L0. Its semantical rules explicitly specify which statements are analytic in L0.

[2] A problem immediately surfaces: To extensionally define what is analytic in L0, the intensional  meaning of 'analytic' is presupposed in the rules, simply because “the rules contain the word ‘analytic’ which we don’t understand!” (Quine, 1980: 33) Although we have an extensional definition of 'analytic,’ we do not have an intensional definition, that is, we do not understand what analyticity means, regardless if we have a list of particular expressions that are allegedly analytic. For instance, if I asked you to compile a list of things that are “smargon,” and you did, but you had no idea what the word ‘smargon’ means, you’d be in trouble—how could you even compile your list without knowing what ‘smargon’ means?

[3] Perhaps though, one could understand the term 'analytic for L0' simply as a convention, calling it 'K' so it looks like the intensional meaning of the word  'analytic—' that is, a well-defined intensional account of analytic—is not at work anywhere. But, Quine asks, why the specific class K, and not some other arbitrary class, for example, L-Z? (Quine, 1980: 33) For instance, let’s say that I wanted to arbitrarily give a list of all things that are smargon, but I don’t know what the word ‘smargon’ means. So I create a list of things that just so happen to be green. But why did I pick just green things? Why not orange things, or things that had no particular color at all?

[4] Let it be supposed instead then, that there is a kind of semantical rule that does not specify which statements are analytic, but simply those that are true. But not all truths, just a certain set of truths. Thus, one may then define “analytic truths” as those that belong to this set. And so, "A statement is analytic if it is (not merely true but) true according to the semantical rule" (Quine, 1980: 34). However (generally speaking), the same problem surfaces in terms of "semantical rule—" how does it specify which statements are to be included in the class of truths without in some sense presupposing the intensional meaning of the word 'analytic?' The circle is pervasive, and so: “we might just stop tugging at our bootstraps altogether” (Quine, 1980: 36).

And thus, in 1950, Quine is confident that, perhaps once and for all, after nearly twenty years of intermittent discussion of the matter with Carnap and others, he should reject the notion of “analyticity.”

3. Metaphysics: Some Implications

Quine’s rejection of analyticity has many implications, particularly for the field of metaphysics. According to the main camp of metaphysicians, metaphysics, generally speaking, employs a method where deductive logical laws are applied to a set of axioms that are necessarily true. The propositions produced by such a method are, as a result, necessarily true as well (think, for instance of Descartes’ method /descarte/#H3 or Leibniz’s). For the most part, these truths, the axioms that they are derived from, and the logical laws that are used to derive them, are thought to reflect the necessary and eternal nature of the universe.

However, if there are, as Quine claims, no such things as necessary truths, that is, analytic truths, then this main camp of metaphysics is essentially eviscerated. It is, at best, a field where clever people play still cleverer games, manipulating allegedly “necessary” truths with allegedly “necessary” laws. This attack on metaphysics by Quine has spawned new camps of metaphysics which do not rely in this way on deductive methods.

What method then, did Quine use? The empirical method. In this respect, Quine was a scientific philosopher, that is, what is often called a naturalistic philosopher.  Like Hume, he believed that philosophical conclusions were not necessarily true—they did not reflect or capture the essential nature of humanity, let alone the nature of the universe. Rather, they were testable, and potentially could be rejected.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Carnap, R. The Logical Structure of the World; Psuedo problems in Philosophy, Second Edition. Translated by R.A. George, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1967 [Original publication date 1928]
  • Carnap, R. The Logical Syntax of Language. Translated by A. Smeaton. London: Routledge, 1959.
  • Carnap, R. Meaning and Necessity. Second edition with supplements. Chicago: Chicago University Press, 1947.
  • Creath, R. Dear Carnap, Dear Van: The Quine-Carnap Correspondence and Related Work. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1990.
  • Davidson, D. and Hintikka, J. eds. Words and Objections, Essays on the Work of W.V. Quine. Synthese Library 21. Revised ed. Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 1969.
  • Dreben, Burton. “In Medius Rebus.” Inquiry, 37 (1995): pp. 441-7.
  • Dreben, Burton. “Putnam, Quine—and the Facts.” Philosophical Topics, 20 (1992): pp. 293-315.
  • Fara, R. Director: “In Conversation: W.V. Quine.” A Philosophy International Production, London: Philosophy International, London School of Economics, 1994: tapes 1-8.
  • Fogelin, R. “Aspects of Quine’s Naturalized Epistemology.” The Cambridge Companion to Quine, ed. R.F. Gibson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004
  • Gibson, R.F., ed., The Cambridge Companion to Quine, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004
  • Hintikka, J. “Three Dogmas of Quine’s Empiricism,” Revue Internationale de Philosophie 51 (1997): pp. 457-477
  • Hookway, C. Quine: Language, Experience and Reality. Cambridge: Polity Press, 1988.
  • Leonardi, P. and Santambrogio, M. On Quine, New Essays. Oxford: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Pakaluk, M. “Quine’s 1946 Lectures on Hume.” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 27 (1989): pp. 445-459
  • Quine, W.V. A System of Logistic, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1934.
  • Quine, W.V. “Carnap” Yale Review 76 (1987): pp. 226-230.
  • Quine, W.V. From Stimulus to Science, Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1995.
  • Quine, W.V. “In Praise of Observation Sentences.” Journal of Philosophy, XC, #3 (1993): pp. 107-116.
  • Quine, W.V. Methods of Logic, fourth edition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982 [Original edition, 1950].
  • Quine, W.V. “On Empirically Equivalent Systems of the World.” Erkenntnis 9, 3 (1975): 313-28.
  • Quine, W.V. "On Philosophers' Concern with Language." (editor's title: "Words are all we have to go on"), Times Literary Supplement. July 3, 1992: 8
  • Quine, W.V. Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia, 1969.
  • Quine, W.V. Pursuit of Truth. Revised ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1992
  • Quine, W.V. Quiddities: An Intermittently Philosophical Dictionary. Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1987.
  • Quine, W.V. “Review of Carnap,” Philosophical Review, 44 (1935): pp. 394-7.
  • Quine, W.V. The Roots of Reference, La Salle: Illinois: Open Court, 1974.
  • Quine, W.V. “States of Mind.” Journal of Philosophy 82 (1985) pp. 5-8.
  • Quine, W.V. The Time of My Life: An Autobiography, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1987.
  • Quine, W.V. Theories and Things. Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1981
  • Quine, W.V. “Two Dogmas in Retrospect,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 21 #3 (1991): pp. 265-274
  • Quine, W.V. “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism” in From a Logical Point of View: 9 logico-philosophical essays. 2nd ed., revised. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1980 [Original publication date: 1953]
  • Quine, W.V. “The Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” The Philosophical Review 60 (1951): 20-43.
  • Quine, W.V. The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays. Enlarged edition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard, 1976.
  • Quine, W.V. Word and Object. Cambridge, MA: MIT, 1960..
  • Richardson, A.W. Carnap’s Construction of the World: The Aufbau and the Emergence of Logical Empiricism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998,
  • Rocknak, S. “Understanding Quine in Terms of the Aufbau: Another Look at Naturalized Epistemology” in Beyond Description: Naturalism and Normativity, eds. Marcin Milkowski and Konrad Talmud-Kaminski, Texts in Philosophy (College Publications, 2010, Vol. 13, pp. 195-210).
  • Romanos, G.P. Quine and Analytic Philosophy. Cambridge: MIT Press, 1983.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Our Knowledge of the External World. London: George Allen and Unwin Ltd., 1961.
  • Schilpp, P.A. ed, The Philosophy of Rudolph Carnap: Library of Living Philosophers, II. La Salles, Illinois: Open Court, 1963
  • Schilpp, P.A. and Edwin L., eds. The Philosophy of W.V. Quine: Library of Living Philosophers, XVII, La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1986.
  • Schilpp, P.A. and Edwin L., eds. The Philosophy of W.V. Quine: Library of Living Philosophers, XVII, Expanded Edition, La Salle, Illinois: Open Court, 1998.
  • Shahan, R.W. and Swoyer, C. eds. Essays on the Philosophy of W.V. Quine, Norman: University of Oklahoma Press, 1979
  • Tooke, J.H., The Divisions of Purley, vol. 1, London, 1786, Boston, 1806.
  • White, M. “The Analytic and the Synthetic: An Untenable Dualism,” John Dewey: Philosopher of Science and Freedom, ed. S. Hook. New York: Dial, 1950.
  • Whitehead, A.N. and Bertrand Russell. Principia Mathematica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1910.


Author Information

Stefanie Rocknak
Hartwick College
U. S. A.

John Langshaw Austin (1911—1960)

J. L. Austin was one of the more influential British philosophers of his time, due to his rigorous thought, extraordinary personality, and innovative philosophical method. According to John Searle, he was both passionately loved and hated by his contemporaries. Like Socrates, he seemed to destroy all philosophical orthodoxy without presenting an alternative, equally comforting, orthodoxy.

Austin is best known for two major contributions to contemporary philosophy: first, his ‘linguistic phenomenology’, a peculiar method of philosophical analysis of the concepts and ways of expression of everyday language; and second, speech act theory, the idea that every use of language carries a performative dimension (in the well-known slogan, “to say something is to do something”). Speech act theory has had consequences and import in research fields as diverse as philosophy of language, ethics, political philosophy, philosophy of law, linguistics, artificial intelligence and feminist philosophy.

This article describes Austin’s linguistic method and his speech act theory, and it describes the original contributions he made to epistemology and philosophy of action. It closes by focusing on two main developments of speech act theory─the dispute between conventionalism and intentionalism, and the debate on free speech, pornography, and censorship.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Method
  2. Philosophy of Language
    1. Meaning and Truth
    2. Speech Acts
  3. Epistemology
    1. Sense and Sensibilia
    2. Other Minds
      1. Knowledge of Particular Empirical Facts
      2. Knowledge of Someone Else’s Mental States
  4. Philosophy of Action
  5. Legacy
    1. Speech Act Theory
      1. Conventionalism and Intentionalism
      2. Free Speech and Pornography
    2. Epistemology
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Method

John Langshaw Austin, born on March 26th 1911 in Lancaster, England. He was trained as a classicist at Balliol College Oxford. He first came to philosophy by studying Aristotle, who deeply influenced his own philosophical method. He also worked on the philosophy of Leibniz and translated Frege’s Grundlagen. Austin spent his whole academic life in Oxford, where he was White’s Professor of Moral Philosophy from 1952 until his death in 1960. During the Second World War Austin was commissioned in the Intelligence Corps, and played a leading role in the organization of D-Day, leaving the British Army in 1945 with the rank of Lt. Colonel. Austin published only seven articles. According to Searle, Austin’s reluctance to publish was partly characteristic of his own attitude, but also it was part of the culture of Oxford at the time: “Oxford had a long tradition of not publishing during one’s lifetime, indeed it was regarded as slightly vulgar to publish” (Searle 2001, 227). Most of Austin’s work was thus published posthumously, and includes a collection of papers (Austin 1961), and two series of lectures reconstructed by the editors on the basis of Austin’s lecture notes: the lectures on perception, edited by Geoffrey Warnock (Austin 1962a), and the William James Lectures held at Harvard in 1955, devoted to speech acts, and edited by James O. Urmson (Austin 1962b) for the first edition, and by Urmson and Marina Sbisa for the second (Austin 1975).

Austin had a profound dissatisfaction not only with the traditional way of philosophizing, but also with Logical Positivism (whose leading figure in Oxford was Alfred J. Ayer). In particular, his dissatisfaction was directed towards a way of practicing philosophy which, in Austin’s view, was responsible for the production of tidy dichotomies, and instead of clarifying the problems at issue, seemed to lead to oversimplifications and dogmatic and preconceived schemes of thought. Austin thus developed a new philosophical methodology and style, which became paradigmatic of Ordinary Language Philosophy. Austin does not claim that this method is the only correct method to adopt. Rather, it represents a valuable preliminary approach to at least some of the most stubborn problems in the tradition of Western philosophy, such as those of freedom, responsibility, and perception. According to Austin, the starting point in philosophy should be the analysis of the concepts and ways of expression of everyday language, and the reconnaissance of our ordinary language. This would help to dismantle the ‘philosophical mistakes’ induced by the way philosophers use certain ordinary words, on the one hand, and, on the other, to gain access to actual features in the world picked out by the expressions we use to describe it.

Ordinary language is not the last word: in principle it can everywhere be supplemented and improved upon and superseded. Only remember, it is the first word. [Austin 1956a/1961, 185]

According to Austin, in ordinary language are deposited all the distinctions and connections established by human beings, as if our words in their daily uses “had stood up to the long test of the survival of the fittest” (Austin 1956a/1961, 182). It is necessary, first of all, to carefully consider the terminology available to us, by making a list of the expressions relevant to the domain at issue: a sort of ‘linguistic phenomenology’ carried out with the help of the dictionary and of the imagination, by searching for combinations of expressions and synonyms, devising linguistic thought-experiments and unusual contexts and scenarios, and speculating about our linguistic reactions to them. The examination of ordinary language enables us to pay attention to the richness of linguistic facts and to tackle philosophical problems from a fresh and unprejudiced perspective.

To be sure, this is not a new methodology in the history of philosophy. Still, this strategy is now carried out with distinctive meticulousness and on a large scale on the one hand, and is undertaken and evaluated collectively, so as to gain a reasonable consensus, on the other. For Austin, philosophy is not an endeavor to be pursued privately, but a collective labor. This was in fact the gist of Austin’s “Saturday mornings,” weekly meetings held during term at Oxford and attended by philosophers of language, moral philosophers and jurists. Austin’s method was better meant for philosophical discussion and research along these lines than for publication: we can nonetheless fully appreciate it in How to Do Things with Words (1962b), and in papers like “A Plea for Excuses” (1956a), and “Ifs and Cans” (1956b).

Austin’s method has been regarded by some as pedantic, as a mere insistence that all we must do is use our words carefully, with no genuine interest in the phenomena which arouse our philosophical worries. There are indeed limitations to his methodology: on the one hand, many philosophical questions still remain untouched even after a meticulous reformulation; on the other hand, our everyday language does not embody all the distinctions which could be relevant for a philosophical inquiry (compare Searle 2001, 228-229). But Austin is far from being concerned merely by language: his focus is always also on the phenomena talked about – as he says, “It takes two to make a truth” (Austin 1950/1961, 124fn; compare Martin 2007).

2. Philosophy of Language

a. Meaning and Truth

With the help of his innovative methodology, Austin takes a new stance towards our everyday language. As is well known, philosophers and logicians like Gottlob Frege, Bertrand Russell, the earlier Ludwig Wittgenstein, Alfred Tarski and Willard Quine want to build a perfect language for philosophical and scientific communication, that is, an artificial language devoid of all the ambiguities and imperfections that characterize natural languages. Conversely, ordinary language philosophers (besides Austin, the later Wittgenstein, Friedrich Waismann, Paul Grice, Peter Strawson) view natural language as an autonomous object of analysis – and its apparent imperfections as signs of richness and expressive power.

In a formal language, semantic conventions associate with each term and each sentence a fixed meaning, once and for all. By contrast, the expressions of a natural language seem essentially incomplete; as a result, it seems impossible to fully verify our everyday sentences. The meanings of our terms are only partially constrained, depending on the beliefs, desires, goals, activities, and institutions of our linguistic community. The boundaries, even when temporarily fixed, are unstable and open to new uses and new conventions in unusual situations. In "The Meaning of a Word," Austin takes into consideration different contexts of utterance of sentences containing familiar terms, in order to create unusual occasions of use: extraordinary or strange cases are meant to contrast with our intuitions and reveal moments of tension hidden in natural language. What are we to say about “It's a goldfinch” uttered about a goldfinch that "does something outrageous (explodes, quotes Mrs. Woolf, or what not)"? (Austin 1940/1961, 88). Austin’s main point is that it is in principle impossible to foresee all the possible circumstances which could lead us to modify or retract a sentence. Our everyday terms are extremely flexible, and can still be used in odd cases. Concerning “That man is neither at home nor not at home,” Austin writes: "Somehow we cannot see what this 'could mean' – there are no semantic conventions, explicit or implicit, to cover this case: yet it is not prohibited in any way – there are no limiting rules about what we might or might not say in extraordinary cases" (Austin 1940/1961, 68). Of a dead man, lying on his bed, what would we say? That he is at home? That he is not at home?

Similarly, should the utterance “France is hexagonal” be taken as true or false? According to Austin we must take into consideration the speaker’s goals and intentions, the circumstances of utterance, and the obligations we undertake in asserting something. Assertions are not simply true or false, but more or less objective, adequate, exaggerated, and rough: “‘true’ and ‘false’ […] do not stand for anything simple at all; but only for a general dimension of being a right or proper thing to say as opposed to a wrong thing, in these circumstances, to this audience, for these purposes and with these intentions” (Austin 1975, 145).

b. Speech Acts

Austin’s most celebrated contribution to contemporary philosophy is his theory of speech acts, presented in How to Do Things with Words (Austin 1975). While for philosophers interested mainly in formal languages the main function of language is describing reality, representing states of affairs and making assertions about the world, for Austin our utterances have a variety of different uses. A similar point is made in Philosophical Investigations by Wittgenstein, who underlines the “countless” uses we may put our sentences to (Wittgenstein 1953: § 23). Austin contrasts the “desperate” Wittgensteinian image of the countless uses of language with his accurate catalogue of the various speech acts we may perform – a taxonomy similar to the one employed by an entomologist trying to classify the many (but not countless) species of beetles.

Not all utterances, then, are assertions concerning states of affairs. Take Austin’s examples

(1) I name this ship the ‘Queen Elisabeth’

as uttered in the course of the launching of a ship, or

(2) I bet you sixpence it will rain tomorrow.

The utterer of (1) or (2) is not describing the launching ceremony or a bet, but doing it. By uttering these sentences we bring about new facts, “as distinguished from producing consequences in the sense of bringing about states of affairs in the ‘normal’ way, that is, changes in the natural course of events” (Austin 1975: 117): by uttering (1) or (2) we modify the social reality, institute new conventions, and undertake obligations. In the first lessons of How to Do Things with Words, Austin traces a tentative distinction between constatives and performatives, to be abandoned in the subsequent lessons. Constatives, on the one hand, are sentences like

(3) The cat is on the mat:

they aim to describe states of affairs and are assessable as true or false. Performatives like (1) and (2), on the other hand, do rather than report something: they perform acts governed by norms and institutions (such as the act of marrying or baptizing) or social conventions (such as the act of betting or promising) and do not seem assessible as true or false. This last controversial claim is not argued for (“I assert this as obvious and do not argue it,” Austin 1975, 6): the claim is only provisional and subject to revision in the light of later sections (Austin 1975, 4n).

According to Austin it is possible and fruitful to shed light on standard cases of successful communication, and to specify the conditions for the smooth functioning of a performative, by focusing on non-standard cases and communicative failures. As we have said, performatives cannot be assessed as true or false, but they are subject to different types of invalidity or failure, called “infelicities.” In some cases the attempt to perform an act fails or “misfires.” The act is “null and void” on the basis of the violation of two kinds of rules:

A.1: there must exist an accepted conventional procedure having a certain conventional effect, that procedure to include the uttering of certain words by certain persons in certain circumstances;

A.2: that procedure must be invoked in adequate circumstances and by appropriate persons.

Further infelicities concern the execution of the procedure, for it must be executed by all participants both

B.1: correctly, and

B.2: completely.

Finally, there are cases in which the performance of an act is achieved, but there is an abuse of the procedure, due to the violation of two kinds of rules:

C.1: the procedure must be executed by the speaker with appropriate thoughts, feelings or intentions;

C.2: the participants must subsequently conduct themselves in accordance with the procedure performed.

As we said, in How to Do Things with Words Austin draws the distinction between constatives and performatives merely as a preliminary to the presentation of his main thesis, namely that there is a performative dimension in any use of language. The putative class of performatives seems to admit only specific verbs (like to promise, to bet, to apologize, to order), all in the first person singular present. Any attempt to characterize the class with grammatical or lexical criteria, however, is bound to fail. We may in fact perform the act of, say, ordering by using an explicit performative, as in

(4) I order you to close the door

but also with

(5) Close the door!

Similarly, there are performative verbs also for acts of stating, asserting, or concluding, as in

(6) I assert that the Earth is flat.

The very distinction between utterances assessable along the dimension of truth and falsehood (constatives) and utterances assessable along the dimension of felicity or infelicity (performatives) is a mere illusion. To show this, Austin presents two arguments:

a) on the one hand, constatives may be assessed as happy or unhappy: like performatives, assertions require appropriate conditions for their felicitous performance (to give an example, it does not seem appropriate to make an assertion one does not believe);

b) on the other hand, performatives may be assessed in terms of truth and falsehood, or in terms of some conformity to the facts: of a verdict we say that it is fair or unfair, of a piece of advice that it is good or bad, of praise that it is deserved or not.

By a) and b) Austin is led to the conclusion that the distinction between constatives and performatives is inadequate: all sentences are tools we use in order to do something – to say something is always to do something. Therefore it is necessary to develop a general theory of the uses of language and of the acts we perform by uttering a sentence: a general theory of what Austin calls illocutionary force.

Within the same total speech act Austin distinguishes three different acts: locutionary, illocutionary and perlocutionary.

  • The locutionary act is the act of saying something, the act of uttering certain expressions, well-formed from a syntactic point of view and meaningful. It may furthermore be analyzed into a phonetic act (the act of uttering certain noises), a phatic act (the act of uttering words, that is, sounds as conforming to a certain vocabulary and grammar), and a rhetic act (the act of using these words with a certain meaning – sense or reference).
  • To perform a locutionary act is also and eo ipso to perform an illocutionary act (Austin 1975, 98). An illocutionary act is a way of using language, and its performance is the performance of an act in saying something as opposed to performance of an act of saying something. It corresponds to the force that an utterance like (5) has in a particular context: order, request, entreaty, or challenge.
  • The perlocutionary act corresponds to the effects brought about by performing an illocutionary act, to its consequences (intentional or non-intentional) on the feelings, thoughts, or actions of the participants. According to Austin the speaker, by saying what she says, performs another kind of act (like persuading, convincing, or alerting) because she can be taken as responsible for those effects (compare Sbisa 2006 and 2013). Yet the perlocutionary consequences of illocutionary acts are non-conventional, not being completely under the speaker’s control, but rather related to the specific circumstances in which the act is performed. Austin makes a further distinction between perlocutionary objects (the consequences brought about by an illocutionary act in virtue of its force – as alerting can be a consequence of the illocutionary act of warning) and perlocutionary sequels (the consequences brought about by an illocutionary act without a systematic connection to its force – as surprising can be a consequence of the illocutionary act of asserting) (Austin 1975: 118).

In the last lesson of How to Do Things with Words Austin tentatively singles out five classes of illocutionary acts, using as a starting point a list of explicit performative verbs: Verdictives, Exercitives, Commissives, Behabitives, Expositives.

  • The class of Verdictives includes acts (formal or informal) of giving a verdict, estimate, or appraisal (as acquitting, reckoning, assessing, diagnosing). These may concern facts or values.
  • The class of Exercitives includes acts of exerting powers, rights or influence (as appointing, voting, ordering, warning). These presuppose that the speaker has a certain kind of authority or influence.
  • The class of Commissives includes acts that commit the speaker to doing something (as promising, undertaking, consenting, opposing, betting).
  • The class of Expositives includes acts that clarify reasons, arguments, or communications (as affirming, denying, stating, describing, asking, answering).
  • The class of Behabitives includes acts having to do with attitudes and social behavior (as apologizing, congratulating, commending, thanking). These include reactions to other people’s behavior or fortune, and are particularly vulnerable to insincerity (condition C.1).

Austin characterizes the illocutionary act as the conventional aspect of language (to be contrasted with the perlocutionay act). As we said before, for any speech act there must exist an accepted conventional procedure having a certain conventional effect (condition A.1): if the conventional procedure is executed according to further conditions, the act is successfully performed. This claim seems plausible as far as institutional or social acts (like naming a ship, or betting) are concerned: the conventional dimension is here manifest because it is our society (and sometimes our laws) that validates those acts. The claim seems less plausible as far as speech acts in general are concerned: nothing conventional, or semantic, makes of (5) an order, or a challenge, or an entreaty – the illocutionary force of the utterance is fixed by the context of utterance. More generally, according to Austin the speaker’s intentions play only a minor role in the performance of a speech act (violation of condition C.1 leads to an abuse of the procedure, but not to a failure of the speech act). Drawing on Gricean ideas, Peter Strawson argues that what makes of (5) an illocutionary act of ordering instead of entreating are the speaker’s intentions – intentions the speaker may (but need not) make available to the audience using linguistic conventions:

I do not want to deny that there may be conventional postures or procedures for entreating… But I do want to deny that an act of entreaty can be performed only as conforming to some such conventions. What makes X's words to Y an entreaty not to go is something complex enough, no doubt relating to X's situation, attitude to Y, manner, and current intention. [Strawson 1964, 444; compare Warnock 1973 and Bach & Harnish 1979]

Marina Sbisa disagrees with Strawson’s reading of the conventionality of illocutionary acts and identifies two distinct claims in Austin’s conventionalism: (a) illocutionary acts are performed via conventional devices (like linguistic conventions); and (b) illocutionary acts produce conventional effects. Austin specifies three kinds of conventional effects: the performance of an illocutionary act involves the securing of uptake, that is, bringing about the understanding of the meaning and force of the locution; the illocutionary act takes effect in conventional ways, as distinguished from producing consequences in the sense of bringing about changes in the natural course of events; and many illocutionary acts invite by convention a response or sequel (Austin 1975, 116-117). According to Sbisa, Austin deals too briefly with the conventionality of the effects produced by illocutionary acts (b) as opposed to the conventionality of the devices by which we perform illocutionary acts (a), leaving room for Strawson’s distinction between two groups of illocutionary acts: those depending on some convention the speaker follows, and those depending on a particular kind of intention of the speaker (Sbisa 2013, 26). On this point see below, § 5.a.

3. Epistemology

There are two main examples of Austin’s philosophical method applied to epistemological issues: the paper “Other Minds” (1946), and the series of lectures Sense and Sensibilia, delivered at Oxford and Berkeley during the decade from 1947 to 1958, and published in 1962. “Other Minds” is a paper given in the homonymous symposium at joint sessions of the Mind Association and the Aristotelian Society (John Wisdom, Alfred J. Ayer, and Austin were the main participants), and its topic was a much debated one in the middle decades of the twentieth century. In Sense and Sensibilia Austin applies his linguistic analysis to the sense-data theory and the more general foundational theory of knowledge, within which sense-data played the role of the basis of the very structure of empirical knowledge, in order to gain a clarification of the concept of perception.

a. Sense and Sensibilia

These lectures represent a very detailed criticism of the claims put forward by A. J. Ayer in The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge (1940), and, to a lesser extent, of those contained in H. H. Price’s Perception (1932) and G. J. Warnock’s Berkeley (1953). Austin challenges the sense-data theory, according to which we never directly perceive material objects. On the contrary, it is claimed by such theory, we perceive nothing but sense-data.

The notion of sense-data is introduced to identify the object of perception in abnormal, exceptional cases, for example, refraction, mirages, mirror-images, hallucinations, and so forth. In such cases perceptions can either be ‘qualitatively delusive’ or ‘existentially delusive,’ depending on whether sense-data endow material things with qualities that they do not really possess, or the material things presented do not exist at all. In all such cases, the sense-data theorist maintains, we directly perceive sense-data. The subsequent step in this argument, named the argument from illusion, is to claim that in ordinary cases too we directly perceive merely sense-data.

Austin’s goal is not to answer the question “What are the objects of perception?” Austin aims to get rid of “such illusions as ‘the argument from illusion’” on the one hand, and to offer on the other a “technique for dissolving philosophical worries” by clarifying the meaning of words such as ‘real,’ ‘look,’ ‘appear’ and ‘seem’ (Austin 1962a, 4-5). The argument from illusion amounts to a misconception inasmuch as it introduces a bogus dichotomy: that between sense-data and material objects. Austin challenges this dichotomy, and the subsequent claim that abnormal, illusory perceptions do not differ from normal, veridical ones in terms of quality (in both cases sense-data are perceived, though in different degrees), by presenting different cases of perceptions in order to show that “there is no one kind of thing that we ‘perceive’ but many different kinds, the number being reducible if at all by scientific investigation and not by philosophy” (Austin 1962a, 4).

Besides chairs, tables, pens and cigarettes, indicated by the sense-data theorist as examples of material objects, Austin draws attention to rainbows, shadows, flames, vapors and gases as cases of things we ordinarily say that we perceive, even though we would not classify them as material things. Likewise, Austin argues, there is no single way in which we are ‘deceived by senses’ (that is, to perceive something unreal or not material), but “things may go wrong […] in lots of different ways – which don’t have to be, and must not be assumed to be, classifiable in any general fashion” (Austin 1962a, 13). Moreover, Austin asks whether we would be prone to speak of ‘illusions’ with reference to dreams, phenomena of perspective, photos, mirror-images or pictures on the screen at the cinema. By recalling the familiarity of the circumstances in which we encounter these phenomena and the ways in which we ordinarily consider them, Austin intends to show how the dichotomies between sense-data and material objects, and between illusory perceptions and veridical ones, are in fact spurious alternatives.

The facts of perceptions are “diverse and complicated” and the analysis of words in their contexts of use enables us to make the subtle distinctions obliterated by the “obsession” some philosophers have for certain words (for example, ‘real’ and ‘reality’), and by the lack of attention to the (not even remotely interchangeable) uses of verbs like ‘look,’ ‘appear,’ and ‘seem.’ The way the sense-data theorists use the words ‘real’ and ‘directly’ in the argument from illusion is not the ordinary use of these words, but a new use, which nevertheless fails to be explained. Austin does not want to rule out the possibility of tracing, for theoretical purposes, new distinctions, and thus of emending our linguistic practices by introducing technical terms, but he rather proposes always to pay attention to the ordinary uses of our words, in order to avoid oversimplifications and distortions.

As an example, Austin examines the word ‘real’ and contrasts the ordinary, firmly established meanings of that word as fixed by the everyday ways we use it to the ways it is used by sense-data theorists in their arguments. What Austin recommends is a careful consideration of the ordinary, multifarious meanings of that word in order not to posit, for example, a non-natural quality designed by that word, common to all the things to which that word is attributed (‘real ducks,’ ‘real cream,’ ‘real progress,’ ‘real color,’ ‘real shape,’ and so forth).

Austin highlights the complexities proper to the uses of ‘real’ by observing that it is (i) a substantive-hungry word that often plays the role of (ii) adjuster-word, a word by means of which “other words are adjusted to meet the innumerable and unforeseeable demands of world upon language” (Austin 1962a, 73). Like ‘good,’ it is (iii) a dimension-word, that is, “the most general and comprehensive term in a whole group of terms of the same kind, terms that fulfil the same function” (Austin 1962a, 71): that is, ‘true,’ ‘proper,’ ‘genuine,’ ‘live,’ ‘natural,’ ‘authentic,’ as opposed to terms such as ‘false,’ ‘artificial,’ ‘fake,’ ‘bogus,’ ‘synthetic,’ ‘toy,’ but also to nouns like ‘dream,’ ‘illusion,’ ‘mirage,’ ‘hallucination.’ ‘Real,’ is also (iv) a word whose negative use “wears the trousers” (a trouser-word) (Austin 1962a, 70).

In order to determine the meaning of ‘real’ we have to consider, case by case, the ways and contexts in which it is used. Only by doing so, according to Austin, can we avoid introducing false dichotomies (for a criticism of Austin’s attack on sense-data see Ayer 1967 and Smith 2002).

b. Other Minds

In this paper Austin tackles the philosophical problems of the possibility of knowing someone else’s mental states (for example, that another man is angry) and of the reliability of the reasons to which we appeal when we justify our assertions about particular empirical facts (for example, that the bird moving around my garden is a goldfinch). The target of Austin’s analysis is the skeptical outcome of the challenge of such a possibility on the part of certain philosophers (in this case Austin is addressing some of John Wisdom’s contentions). As to the knowledge of particular empirical facts, given that “human intellect and senses are, indeed, inherently fallible and delusive” (Austin 1946/1961, 98), the skeptic claims that we should never, or almost never, say that we know something, except for what I can perceive with my senses now, for example, “Here is something that looks red to me now.” On the other hand, the possibility of knowing someone else’s mental states is challenged by means of the idea of a privileged access to our own sensations and mental states, such that only about them can we not ‘be wrong’ “in the most favoured sense” (Austin 1946/1961, 90).

i. Knowledge of Particular Empirical Facts

Austin engages in an examination of the kinds of answers we would provide, in ordinary, concrete and specific circumstances, to challenges to our claims of knowledge. For instance, in responding to someone’s question, “How do you know?” in the face of my claim “That is a goldfinch,” my answer could appeal to my past experience, by virtue of which I have learned something about goldfinches, and hence to the criteria for determining that something is a goldfinch, or to the circumstances of the current case, which enable me to determine that the bird moving around my garden now is a goldfinch. The ways in which, in ordinary circumstances, our claims can be challenged, or be wrong, are specific (ways that the context helps us to determine), and there are recognized procedures appropriate to the particular type of case to which we can appeal to justify or verify such claims.

The precautions to take, in ordinary cases, in order to claim to know something “cannot be more than reasonable, relative to current intents and purposes” (Austin 1946/1961, 88), inasmuch as in order to suppose that one is mistaken there must be some concrete reason relative to the specific case. On the contrary, the “wile of the metaphysician,” Austin claims, amounts to phrasing her doubts and questions in a very general way, and “not specifying or limiting what may be wrong,” “so that I feel at a loss ‘how to prove’” what she has challenged (Austin 1946/1961, 87).

By drawing a parallel with the performative formula ‘I promise,’ Austin claims that in uttering ‘I know’ the speaker does not describe her mental state (this would be, in Austin’s terms, a descriptive fallacy). Rather, in the appropriate circumstances, she does something: she gives others her word, that is, her authority for saying that ‘S is P.’

Austin’s analysis of the epistemological terms in their ordinary, specific uses is meant to determine the conditions under which our claims are felicitous, successful speech acts. These conditions are the ones we typically appeal to in order to justify our claims of knowledge should they be challenged.

Whether Austin’s strategy proves to be successful against the skeptical challenge, which rests on a metaphysical and logical possibility, is a further issue to be resolved.

ii. Knowledge of Someone Else’s Mental States

Austin objects to the idea (as claimed for example, by Wisdom) that we know (if ever we do) someone else’s feelings only from the physical symptoms of these feelings: we never know someone else’s feelings in themselves, as we know our own. According to Austin, claims about someone else’s mental states can be tackled like those about particular empirical facts, even though the former are more complex, owing to “the very special nature (grammar, logic) of feelings” (Austin 1946/1961, 105). It is on this special nature that the analysis of Austin in this paper is meant to shed light.

To affirm of someone, ‘I know he is angry,’ requires, on the one hand, a certain familiarity with the person to whom we are attributing the feeling; in particular, familiarity in situations of the same type as the current one. On the other hand, it seems to be necessary to have had a first-person experience of the relevant feeling/emotion.

A feeling (say anger), Austin claims, presents a close connection both with its natural expressions/manifestations, and with the natural occasions of those manifestations, so that “it seems fair to say that ‘being angry’ is in many respects like ‘having mumps’. It is a description of a whole pattern of events, including occasion, symptoms, feeling and manifestation, and possibly other factors besides” (Austin 1946/1961, 109).

Against Wisdom’s claim that we never get at someone else’s anger, but only at the symptoms/signs of his anger, Austin draws attention to the ways we talk about others’ feelings, and highlights the general pattern of events “peculiar to the case of ‘feelings’ (emotions)” on which our attributions are based (Austin 1946/1961, 110). Moreover, emphasis is placed on the fact that in order for feelings and emotions to be attributed, and also self-attributed, a problem of recognition, and of familiarity with the complexities of such pattern, seems to be in place, due to the very way in which the uses of the relevant terms have been learnt.

Emotion terms, for their part, are vague, for, on the one hand, they are often applied to a wide range of situations, while on the other, the patterns they cover are rather complex, such that in “unorthodox” cases there may be hesitation in attribution. Apart from this kind of intrinsic vagueness, doubts may arise as to the correctness of a feeling attribution, or its authenticity, due to cases of misunderstanding or deception. But these cases are special ones, and there are, as in the goldfinch case, “established procedures” for dealing with them.

Unlike the goldfinch case, in which “sensa are dumb” (Austin 1946/1961, 97), in the case of feeling attribution a special place is occupied, within its complex pattern of events, by “the man’s own statement as to what his feelings are” (Austin 1946/1961, 113). According to Austin, “believing in other persons, in authority and testimony, is an essential part of the act of communicating, an act which we all constantly perform. It is as much an irreducible part of our experience as, say, giving promises, or playing competitive games, or even sensing coloured patches” (Austin 1946/1961, 115). Austin thus aims at blocking the skeptical argument by claiming that the possibility of knowing others’ states of minds and feelings is a constitutive feature of our ordinary practices as such, for which there is no “justification” (ibid.). Again, it may still be open to contention whether this is sufficient to refute skepticism.

4. Philosophy of Action

Austin’s contribution to the philosophy of action is traceable mainly to two papers: “A Plea for Excuses” (1956a) and “Three Ways of Spilling Ink” (1966), where the notions of  ‘doing an action,’ and ‘doing something’ are clarified by means of the linguistic analysis of excuses, that is, by considering “the different ways, and different words, in which on occasion we may try to get out of things, to show that we didn’t act ‘freely’ or were not ‘responsible’” (Austin 1966/1961, 273). According to the method dear to Austin, through the analysis of abnormal cases, or failures, it is possible to throw light on the normal and standard cases. An examination of excuses should enable us to gain an understanding of the notion of action, by means of the preliminary elucidation of the notions of responsibility and freedom.

As for the case of ‘knowing,’ Austin’s contribution is one of clarification of use, which sheds light on the notion of ‘doing an action.’

According to Austin, from the analysis of the modifying expressions occurring in excuses (for example, ‘unwittingly,’ ‘impulsively’) and in accusations (‘deliberately,’ ‘purposely,’ ‘on purpose’), it is possible to classify the different breakdowns affecting actions, and thus to dismantle the complex internal details of the machinery of action. Far from being reducible to merely making some bodily movements, doing an action is organized into different stages: the intelligence, the appreciation of the situation, the planning, the decision, and the execution. Moreover, apart from the stages, “we can generally split up what might be named as one action in several distinct ways, into different stretches or phases” (Austin 1956a/1961, 201). In particular, by using a certain term to describe what someone did, we can cover either a smaller or larger stretch of events, distinguishing the act from its consequences, results, or effects. Austin thus points out that it is crucial to determine ‘what modifies what,’ that is, what is being excused, because of the different possible ways in which it is possible to refer to ‘what she did.’ Depending on the way we delimit the act, we may hold a person responsible or not, hence it is extremely important to determine with precision what is being justified.

In order to ascertain someone’s responsibility for a certain action, for example, a child that has spilled ink in class, it is necessary to consider as distinct cases whether he did it ‘intentionally,’ ‘deliberately,’ or ‘on purpose.’ Austin reveals the differences among the three terms in two steps. First, he considers imaginary actions the description of which presents two of the terms as expressly dissociated: for example, to do something intentionally, but not deliberately (for example, to impulsively stretch out one's hand to make things up at the end of a quarrel; see Austin 1966/1961, 276-277); intentionally, but not on purpose (for example, to act wantonly); deliberately, but not intentionally (for example, unintended, though foreseeable, consequences/results of some actions of mine – to ruin one’s debtor by insisting on payment of due debts; see Austin 1966/1961, 278); and on purpose, but not intentionally (this last case seems to verge on impossibility, and has a paradoxical flavor). The logical limits of these combinations enable Austin to single out the differences among the concepts under investigation. Subsequently, as a second step, such differences are made apparent by an analysis of the grammar and philology of the terms (adjectival terminations, negative forms, the prepositions used to form adverbial expressions, and so forth). From this examination each term turns out to mark different ways in which it is possible to do an action, or different ‘aspects’ of action.

Austin’s analysis of the notions of action and responsibility casts light on that of freedom, which is clarified by the examination of “all the ways in which each action may not be ‘free’” (Austin 1956a/1961, 180). Like the word ‘real,’ also in the case of ‘free’ it is the negative use that wears the trousers: the notion of freedom derives its meaning from the concepts excluded, case by case, by each use of the term ‘free’ (for example, consider the following utterances: “I had to escape, since he threatened me with a knife;” “The glass slipped out of my hand because of my astonishment;” “I can’t help checking the email every five minutes”). By considering the specific, ordinary situations in which it is possible or not to ascertain someone’s responsibility for an act (where an issue of responsibility arises), the notions of freedom and responsibility emerge as closely intertwined. In Austin’s words: “As ‘truth’ is not a name for a characteristic of assertions, so ‘freedom’ is not a name for a characteristic of actions, but a name of a dimension in which actions are assessed” (Austin 1956a/1961, 180). Austin does not provide a positive account of the notion of freedom: it is rather elucidated through attention to the different ways in which our actions may be free.

5. Legacy

a. Speech Act Theory

Since the end of the 1960s Speech Act Theory (SAT) has been developed in many directions. Here we will concentrate on two main strands: the dispute between conventionalism and intentionalism on the one hand, and the debate on pornography, free speech, and censorship on the other.

i. Conventionalism and Intentionalism

Peter Strawson’s contribution to Austin’s SAT, with ideas drawn from Paul Grice’s analysis of the notion of non-natural meaning, marks the beginning of the dispute over the role played by convention and intention respectively in the performance of speech acts. Although almost all the developments of SAT contain, in different degrees, both a conventionalist and an intentionalist element, it may be useful to distinguish two main traditions, depending on the preponderance of one element over the other: a conventionalist, Austinian tradition, and an intentionalist, neo-Gricean one. There are two versions of conventionalism: John Searle’s conventionalism of the means, and Marina Sbisa’s conventionalism of the effects (the distinction is marked by Sbisa).

Central to Searle’s systematization of SAT is the hypothesis that speaking a language amounts to being engaged in a rule-governed activity, and that human languages may be regarded as the conventional realizations of a set of underlying constitutive rules, that is, rules that create, rather than just regulate, an activity, to the effect that the existence of such activity logically depends on that of the rules constituting it. Searle’s analysis aims at specifying a set of necessary and sufficient conditions for the successful performance of an illocutionary act (Searle concentrates on the act of promising, but the analysis is further extended to the other types of illocutionary acts, of which several classifications have been developed within SAT). Starting from the felicitous conditions for the performance of an act, a set of semantic rules for the use of ‘the illocutionary force indicating device for that act is extracted. Searle’s position thus qualifies as a conventionalism of the means because the felicitous performance of an illocutionary act obtains thanks to the conformity of the meaning of the utterance used to perform it to the linguistic conventions proper to the language within which the act is performed.

Sbisa developed Austin’s thesis of the conventionality of the illocutionary force by linking it to the second of the three kinds of conventional effects characteristic of the illocutionary act: the production of states of affairs in a way different from natural causation, namely, the production of normative states of affairs, such as obligations, commitments, entitlements, rights, and so forth. According to Sbisa, each type of illocutionary act produces specific conventional effects, which correspond to “assignments to or cancellations from each one of the participants of modal predicates” (Sbisa 2001, 1797), which are conventional insofar as their production depends on intersubjective agreement. The hallmark of such effects is, unlike physical actions, their being liable to annulment, their defeasibility.

The main exemplification of the intentionalist tradition within SAT is the analysis developed by Kent Bach and Robert Harnish. In the opposite direction relative to Searle’s views, Bach and Harnish claim that the link between the linguistic structure of an utterance and the illocutionary act it serves to perform is never semantic, or conventional, but rather inferential.

In order for the illocutionary act to be determined by the hearer, in addition to ‘what is said’ (the semantic content of the utterance), the following are also necessary: the speaker’s illocutionary communicative intention (this intention is reflexive: its fulfillment consists in its being recognized, on the part of the hearer, as intended to be recognized); the contextual beliefs shared by the interlocutors; general beliefs about the communicative situation which play the role of presumptions, that is, expectations about the interlocutor’s behavior which are so basic that they constitute the very conditions of possibility of the communicative exchange (for example, the belief of belonging to the same linguistic community, and that in force to the effect that whenever a member of the community utters an expression, she is doing so with some recognizable illocutionary intent); and, finally, conversational assumptions, drawn from Gricean conversational maxims.

All these elements combine to bring about the inference that enables the hearer to move from the level of the utterance act up to the illocutionary level, going through the locutionary one (note that Bach and Harnish, and Searle himself, part company with Austin in distinguishing the components of the speech act). Bach and Harnish put forward a model, the Speech Act Schema (SAS), which represents the pattern of the inference a hearer follows (and that the speaker intends that she follow) in order to understand the illocutionary act as an act of a certain type (as an order, a promise, an assertion, and so forth).

The merit of the intentionalist analysis offered by Bach and Harnish is that it attempts to integrate SAT within a global account of linguistic communication whose aim is to provide a psychologically plausible account. A shortcoming of this approach seems to be concerned with an essential element of SAT itself: the emphasis put on the normative dimension produced by the performance of speech acts. The intentionalist analysis fails to provide an account of such a normative dimension, since it is maintained that the creation of commitments and obligations is a “moral” question not answerable by SAT. On the other hand, the conventionalist tradition in both its variants seems to show an opposite and equally unsatisfactory tendency. It has in fact been argued, specifically by relevance theorists (see Sperber and Wilson 1995), that the illocutionary level, as identified by SAT, does not effectively play a role in the process of linguistic comprehension. That it does play such a role, as the SAT claims, is an unjustified hypothesis, so runs the relevance theorists’ objection. More generally, this objection urges speech act theorists to confront the cognitive turn in the philosophy of language and linguistics.

ii. Free Speech and Pornography

One more surprising applications of Speech Act Theory concerns the debate on free speech, pornography and censorship (compare Langton 1993, Hornsby 1993, Hornsby & Langton 1998, Saul 2006, Bianchi 2008). Liberal defenders of pornography maintain that pornography – even when violent and degrading – should be protected to defend a fundamental principle: the right to freedom of speech or expression. Conversely, Catharine MacKinnon claims that pornography violates women's right to free speech: more precisely pornography not only causes the subordination and silencing of women, but it also constitutes women’s subordination (a violation of their civil right to equal civil status) and silencing (a violation of their civil right to freedom of speech; MacKinnon 1987). MacKinnon's thesis has been widely discussed and criticized. Rae Langton and Jennifer Hornsby offer a defence of her claim in terms of Austin’s speech act theory: works of pornography can be understood as illocutionary acts of subordinating women or of silencing women. On the one hand, pornography (or at least violent and degrading pornography where women are portrayed as willing sexual objects) subordinates women by ranking them as inferior and legitimizing discrimination against them. On the other hand, pornography silences women by creating a communicative environment that deprives them of their illocutionary potential. The claim that pornography silences women can be analysed along the lines drawn by Austin. According to Langton (1993), one may prevent the performance of a locutionary act by preventing the utterance of certain expressions, using physical violence, institutional norms, or intimidation (locutionary silence). Or one may prevent the performance of a perlocutionary act by disregarding the illocutionary act, even if felicitously achieved (perlocutionary frustration). Or else one may prevent the performance of an illocutionary act by creating a communicative environment that precludes the uptake of the force of the speech act, or the recognition of the speaker’s authority, particularly with respect to women’s refusals of unwanted sex (illocutionary disablement). Indeed in Langton and Hornsby’s perspective, pornography might prevent women from performing the illocutionary act of refusing sex – by contributing to situations where a woman’s ‘No’ is not recognized as a refusal, and rape occurs as a result. Against the protection of pornography as a form of expression (a simple form of locution), Langton and Hornsby argue that pornography does more than simply express: it acts to silence the expressions of women (a form of illocution), thereby restricting their freedom of speech. We are thus confronted with two different, and conflicting, rights or, better, with different people in conflict over the same right, the right to free speech.

b. Epistemology

Austin’s legacy has been taken up in epistemology by individual authors such as Charles Travis (2004), who, with regard to the debate about the nature of perception, claims it to be nonrepresentational, and, along the same lines, by Michael G. F. Martin (2002), who defends a form of nonrepresentational realism.

Austin’s work may be considered as a source of inspiration for contextualism in epistemology, but some scholars tend to resist tracing much affinity by pointing out important differences between Austin’s method and the contextualist approach (see, for example, Baz 2012 and McMyler 2011).

More generally, Mark Kaplan (2000, 2008) has insisted on the necessity of considering our ordinary practices of knowledge attribution as a methodological constraint for epistemology, in order for it to preserve its own intellectual integrity. According to Kaplan, the adoption of an Austinian methodology in epistemology would undermine skeptical arguments about knowledge.

Such an Austinian trend is surely a minority one within the epistemological scenery, but later contributions (Gustafsson and Sørli 2011, Baz 2012) have shown how Austin’s method can play a significant role in dealing with several issues in the contemporary philosophical agenda, in epistemology and philosophy of language in particular.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Austin, John L. 1940. “The Meaning of a Word.” The Moral Sciences Club of the University of Cambridge and the Jowett Society of the University of Oxford. Printed in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 55-75). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1946. “Other Minds.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian SocietySupplementary Volumes 20, 148-187. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 76-116). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1950. “Truth.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian SocietySupplementary Volumes 24, 111-128. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 117-133). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1956a. “A Plea for Excuses.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 57, 1-30. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 175-204). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1956b. “Ifs and Cans.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 42, 109-132. Reprinted in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 205-232). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1961. Philosophical Papers. J. O. Urmson and G. J. Warnock (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1962a. Sense and Sensibilia, G. J. Warnock (ed.). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1962b. How to Do Things with Words. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1966. “Three Ways of Spilling Ink.” The Philosophical Review 75, 427-440. Printed in 1961, James O. Urmson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Philosophical Papers (pp. 272-287). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John L. 1975. How to Do Things with Words, James O. Urmson and Marina Sbisa (eds.). Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2nd edition.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ayer, Alfred J. 1940. The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge. New York: MacMillan.
  • Ayer, Alfred J. 1967. “Has Austin Refuted the Sense-Datum Theory?” Synthese 17, 117-140.
  • Bach, Kent, and Harnish, Robert M. 1979. Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts. Cambridge: MIT Press.
    • The most important development of Speech Act Theory in an intentionalist/inferentialist framework of linguistic communication.
  • Baz, Avner. 2012. When Words Are Called For: A Defense of Ordinary Language Philosophy. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • Arguments against Ordinary Language Philosophy are scrutinized and dismantled, and its general method is applied to the debate about the reliance on intuitions in philosophy, and to that between contextualism and anti-contextualism with respect to knowledge.
  • Berlin, Isaiah, Forguson, Lynd W., Pears, David F., Pitcher, George, Searle, John R., Strawson, Peter F., and Warnock, Geoffrey J. (Eds.). 1973. Essays on J. L. Austin. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Together with Fann 1969, the most important collection of papers on Austin.
  • Bianchi, Claudia. 2008. “Indexicals, Speech Acts and Pornography.” Analysis 68, 310-316.
    • A defense of Langton’s thesis according to which works of pornography can be understood as illocutionary acts of silencing women.
  • Fann, Kuang T. (Ed.). 1969. Symposium on J. L. Austin. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • The standard anthology on Austin’s philosophy, with papers by several of Austin’s colleagues and students.
  • Gustafsson, Martin, and Sørli, Richard. (Eds.). 2011. The Philosophy of J. L. Austin. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A collection of essays, aiming to reassess the importance of Austin’s philosophy by developing his ideas in connection with several issues in the contemporary philosophical agenda, especially in epistemology and philosophy of language.
  • Hornsby, Jennifer. 1993. “Speech Acts and Pornography.” Women’s Philosophy Review 10, 38-45.
  • Hornsby, Jennifer, and Langton, Rae. 1998. “Free Speech and Illocution.” Legal Theory 4, 21-37.
    • An analysis of works of pornography as illocutionary acts of subordinating women, or illocutionary acts of silencing women.
  • Kaplan, Mark. 2000. “To What Must an Epistemology Be True?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 61, 279-304.
  • Kaplan, Mark. 2008. “Austin’s Way with Skepticism.” In John Greco (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Skepticism (pp. 348-371). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Kaplan draws attention to the ordinary practices of knowledge attribution as a methodological constraint epistemology should respect, and as a move that would undermine skeptical arguments about knowledge.
  • Langton, Rae. 1993. “Speech Acts and Unspeakable Acts.” Philosophy and Public Affairs 22, 293-330.
    • A discussion of pornography as a kind of speech act.
  • MacKinnon, Catharine. 1987. “Francis Biddle’s Sister: Pornography, Civil Rights and Speech.” In Catharine MacKinnon (ed.), Feminism Unmodified: Discourses on Life and Law (pp. 163-197). Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
    • A passionate plea against pornography as a violation of women's civil rights.
  • Martin, Michael G. F. 2002. “The Transparency of Experience.” Mind and Language 17, 376-425.
  • Martin, Michael G. F. 2007. “Austin: Sense and Sensibilia Revisited.” London Philosophy Papers, 1-31.
    • Austin’s work on perception is discussed in relation with disjunctive theories of perception (Martin 2007), and a nonrepresentational realist account of perception is put forward (Martin 2002).
  • McMyler, Benjamin. 2011. “Believing What the Man Says about His Own Feelings.” In Martin Gustafsson and Richard Sørli (eds.), The Philosophy of J. L. Austin (pp. 114-145). Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Price, Henry H. (1932). Perception. London: Methuen & Co.
  • Saul, Jennifer. 2006. “Pornography, Speech Acts and Context.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 106, 229-248.
    • A criticism of Langton’s thesis.
  • Sbisa, Marina. 2001. “Illocutionary Force and Degrees of Strength in Language Use.” Journal of Pragmatics 33, 1791-1814.
  • Sbisa, Marina. 2006. “Speech Act Theory.” In Jef Verschueren and Jan-Ola Oestman (eds.), Key Notions for Pragmatics: Handbook of Pragmatics Highlights, Volume 1 (pp. 229-244). Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Sbisa, Marina. 2013. “Locution, Illocution, Perlocution.” In Marina Sbisa and Ken Turner (eds.), Pragmatics of Speech Actions: Handbooks of Pragmatics, Volume 2. Berlin: Mouton de Gruyter.
    • An overview of Austin’s distinction and of its reformulations.
  • Sbisa, Marina, and Turner, Ken (Eds.) 2013. Pragmatics of Speech Actions: Handbooks of Pragmatics, Volume 2. Berlin: Mouton de Gruyter.
  • Searle, John. 2001. “J. L. Austin (1911-1960).” In Aloysius P. Martinich and David Sosa (eds.), A Companion to Analytic Philosophy (pp. 218-230). Oxford: Blackwell.
    • A biographical sketch and brief discussion of Austin’s speech act theory.
  • Smith, Arthur D. 2002. The Problem of Perception. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Sperber, Dan, and Wilson, Deirdre. 1986. Relevance: Communication and Cognition. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Chapter 4, §10 presents a criticism of Speech Act Theory.
  • Strawson, Peter F. 1964. “Intention and Convention in Speech Acts.” Philosophical Review 73, 439-460.
    • The paper that first discussed the role of conventional and intentional elements in the performance of speech acts.
  • Travis, Charles. 2004. “The Silence of the Senses.” Mind 113, 57-94.
    • Nonrepresentationalism about perception is defended, along Austin-inspired lines.
  • Warnock, Geoffrey J. 1953. Berkeley. Harmondsworth: Penguin Books.
  • Warnock, Geoffrey J. 1973. “Some Types of Performative Utterances.” In Isaiah Berlin, Lynd W. Forguson, David F. Pears, George Pitcher, John R. Searle, Peter F. Strawson and Geoffrey J. Warnock (eds.), Essays on J. L. Austin (pp. 69-89). Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1953. Philosophical Investigations. Gertrude E. M. Anscombe (trans.). Oxford: Blackwell.
    • A discussion of the countless uses we may put our sentences to.


Author Information

Federica Berdini
University of Bologna


Claudia Bianchi
Vita-Salute San Raffaele University

Internalism and Externalism in the Philosophy of Mind and Language

This article addresses how our beliefs, our intentions, and other contents of our attitudes are individuated, that is, what makes those contents what they are. Content externalism (henceforth externalism) is the position that our contents depend in a constitutive manner on items in the external world, that they can be individuated by our causal interaction with the natural and social world. In the 20th century, Hilary Putnam, Tyler Burge and others offered Twin Earth thought experiments to argue for externalism. Content internalism (henceforth internalism) is the position that our contents depend only on properties of our bodies, such as our brains. Internalists typically hold that our contents are narrow, insofar as they locally supervene on the properties of our bodies or brains.

Although externalism is the more popular position, internalists such as David Chalmers, Gabriel Segal, and others have developed versions of narrow content that may not be vulnerable to typical externalist objections. This article explains the variety of positions on the issues and explores the arguments for and against the main positions. For example, externalism incurs problems of privileged access to our contents as well as problems about mental causation and psychological explanation, but externalists have offered responses to these objections.

Table of Contents

  1. Hilary Putnam and Natural Kind Externalism
  2. Tyler Burge and Social Externalism
  3. Initial Problems with the Twin Earth Thought Experiments
  4. Two Problems for Content Externalism
    1. Privileged Access
    2. Mental Causation and Psychological Explanation
  5. Different Kinds of Content Externalism
  6. Content Internalism and Narrow Content
    1. Jerry Fodor and Phenomenological Content
    2. Brian Loar and David Chalmers on Conceptual Roles and Two-Dimensional Semantics
    3. Radical Internalism
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Hilary Putnam and Natural Kind Externalism

In “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’” and elsewhere, Putnam argues for what might be called natural kind externalism. Natural kind externalism is the position that our natural kind terms (such as “water” and “gold”) mean what they do because we interact causally with the natural kinds that these terms are about. Interacting with natural kinds is a necessary (but not sufficient) condition for meaning (Putnam 1975, 246; Putnam 1981, 66; Sawyer 1998 529; Nuttecelli 2003, 172; Norris 2003, 153; Korman, 2006 507).

Putnam asserts that the traditional Fregean theory of meaning leaves a subject “as much in the dark as it ever was” (Putnam 1975, 215) and that it, and any descriptivist heirs to it, are mistaken in all their forms. To show this, Putnam insists that Frege accounts for the sense, intension, or meaning of our terms by making two assumptions:

  1. The meaning of our terms (for example, natural kind terms) is constituted by our being in a certain psychological state.
  2. The meaning of such terms determines its extension (Putnam 1975, 219).

Putnam concedes that assumptions one and two may seem appealing, but the conjunction of these assumptions is “…not jointly satisfied by any notion, let alone the traditional notion of meaning.” Putnam suggests abandoning the first while retaining a modified form of the second.

Putnam imagines that somewhere there is a Twin Earth. Earthlings and Twin Earthlings are exact duplicates (down to the last molecule) and have the same behavioral histories. Even so, there is one difference: the substance that we call water, on Twin Earth does not consist of H20, but of XYZ. This difference has not affected how the inhabitants of either planet use their respective liquids, but the liquids have different “hidden structures” (Putnam 1975, 235, 241; Putnam 1986, 288, Putnam 1988, 36). Putnam then imagines it is the year is 1750, before the development of chemistry on either planet. In this time, no experts knew of the hidden structure of water or of its twin, twater. Still, Putnam says, when the inhabitants of Earth use the term “water,” they still refer to the liquid made of H20; when the inhabitants of Twin Earth do the same, they refer to their liquid made of XYZ (Putnam 1975, 270).

The reason this is so, according to Putnam, is that natural kind terms like water have an “unnoticed indexical component.” Water, he says, receives its meaning by our originally pointing at water, such that water is always water “around here.” Putnam admits this same liquid relation “…is a theoretical relation, and may take an indefinite amount of investigation to determine” (Putnam 1975, 234). Given this, earthlings and their twin counterparts use their natural kind terms ((for example, “water,” “gold,” “cat,” and so forth), to refer to the natural kinds of their respective worlds (for example, on Earth, “water” refers to H20 but on Twin Earth it refers to XYZ). In other words, on each planet, twins refer to the “hidden structure” of the liquid of that planet. Thus, Putnam concludes that the first Fregean assumption is false, for while twins across planets are in the same psychological state, when they say “water,” they mean different things. However, understood correctly, the second assumption is true; when the twins say “water,” their term refers to the natural kind (that is, with the proper structural and chemical properties) of their world, and only to that kind.

Natural kind externalism, then, is the position that the meanings of natural kind terms are not determined by psychological states, but are determined by causal interactions with the natural kind itself (that is, kinds with certain structural properties). “Cut the pie any way you like,” Putnam says, “Meaning just ain’t in the head” (Putnam, 1975 227). However, soon after Putnam published “The Meaning of ‘Meaning,’” Colin McGinn and Tyler Burge noted that what is true of linguistic meaning extends to the contents of our propositional attitudes. As Burge says, the twins on Earth and Twin Earth “…are in no sense duplicates in their thoughts,” and this is revealed by how we ascribe attitudes to our fellows (Burge 1982b, 102; Putnam 1996, viii). Propositional attitude contents, it seems, are also not in our heads.

2. Tyler Burge and Social Externalism

In “Individualism and the Mental,” “Two Thought Experiments Reviewed,” “Other Bodies,” and elsewhere Tyler Burge argues for social externalism (Burge, 1979, 1982a, 1982b). Social externalism is the position that our attitude contents (for example, beliefs, intentions, and so forth) depend essentially on the norms of our social environments.

To argue for social externalism, Burge introduces a subject named Bert. Bert has a number of beliefs about arthritis, many of which are true, but in this case, falsely believes that he has arthritis in his thigh. While visiting his doctor, Bert says, “I have arthritis.” After hearing Bert's complaint, the doctor informs his patient that he is not suffering from arthritis. Burge then imagines a counterfactual subject – let us call him Ernie. Ernie is physiologically and behaviorally the same as Bert (non-intentionally described), but was raised in a different linguistic community. In Ernie's community, “arthritis” refers to a disease that occurs in the joints and muscles. When Ernie visits his doctor and mentions arthritis, he is not corrected.

Burge notes that although Ernie is physically and behaviorally the same as Bert, he “…lacks some – perhaps all – of the attitudes commonly attributed with content causes containing the word ‘arthritis…’” Given that arthritis is part of our linguistic community and not his, “it is hard to see how the patient could have picked up the notion of ‘arthritis’” (Burge 1979, 79; Burge 1982a, 286; Burge 1982b, 109). Although Bert and Ernie have always been physically and behaviorally the same, they differ in their contents. However, these differences “…stem from differences outside the patient.” As a result, Burge concludes: “it is metaphysically or constitutively necessary that in order to have a thought about arthritis one must be in relations to others who are in a better position to specify the disease” (Burge 1988, 350; Burge 2003b, 683; Burge 2007, 154).

Unlike Putnam, Burge does not restrict his externalism to natural kinds, or even to obvious social kinds. Regardless of the fact that our fellows suffer incomplete understanding of terms, typically we “take discourse literally” (Burge 1979, 88). In such situations, we still have “… assumed responsibility for communal conventions governing language symbols,” and given this, maintain the beliefs of our home communities (Burge 1979, 114). Burge states that this argument

…does not depend, for example, on the kind of word “arthritis” is. We could have used an artifact term, an ordinary natural kind word, a color adjective, a social role term, a term for a historical style, an abstract noun, an action verb, a physical movement verb, or any of other various sorts of words (Burge 1979, 79).

In other papers, Burge launches similar thought experiments to extend his externalism to cases where we have formed odd theories about artifacts (for example, where we believe sofas to be religious artifacts), to the contents of our percepts (for example, to our perceptions of, say, cracks or shadows on a sidewalk), and even to our memory contents (Burge 1985, 1986, 1998). Other externalists—William Lycan, Michael Tye, and Jonathan Ellis among them—rely on similar thought experiments to extend externalism to the contents of our phenomenal states, or seemings (Lycan 2001; Tye 2008; Ellis 2010). Externalism, then, can seem to generalize to all contents.

3. Initial Problems with the Twin Earth Thought Experiments

Initially, some philosophers found Putnam's Twin Earth thought experiments misleading. In an early article, Eddy Zemach pointed out that Putnam had only addressed the meaning of water in 1750, “…before the development of modern chemistry” (Zemach 1976; 117). Zemach questions whether twins pointing to water “around here” would isolate the right liquids (that is, with H20 on Earth and XYX on Twin Earth). No, such pointing would not have done this, especially long ago; Putnam just stipulates that “water” on Earth meant H20 and on Twin Earth meant XYZ, and that “water” means the same now (Zemach 1976, 123). D. H. Mellor adds that, in point of fact, “specimens are causally downwind of the usage they are supposed to constrain.  They are chosen to fit botanical and genetic knowledge, not the other way around” (Mellor 1977, 305; Jackson 1998, 216; Jackson 2003, 61).

In response to this criticism, externalists have since developed more nuanced formulations of the causal theory of reference, downplaying supposed acts of semantic baptism (for example, “this is water”). The theoretical adjustments can then account for how natural kind term meanings can change or diminish the role of referents altogether (Sainsbury 2007). Zemach, Mellor, Jackson, and others infer that Putnam should have cleaved to the first Fregean principle (that our being in a certain psychological state constitutes meaning) as well as to the second. By combining both Fregean principles, earthlings and their twins, mean the same thing after all.

Similarly, Kent Bach, Tim Crane, Gabriel Segal, and others argue that since Bert incompletely understands “arthritis,” he does not have the contents that his linguistic community does (that is, that the disease refers only to the joints). Given his misunderstanding of “arthritis,” Bert would make odd inferences about the disease, but “these very inferences constitute the evidence for attributing to the patient some notion other than arthritis” (Bach 1987, 267). Crane adds that since Bert and Ernie would have “…all the same dispositions to behavior in the actual and counterfactual situations,” they have the same contents (Crane 1991, 19; Segal 2000, 81). However, Burge never clarifies how much understanding Bert needs to actually have arthritis.(Burge 1986, 702; Burge 2003a, 276). Burge admits, “when a person incompletely understands an attitude, he has some other content that more or less captures his understanding” (Burge 1979, 95). If Bert does have some other content ­– perhaps, “tharthritis”– there is little motive to insist that he also has arthritis. Bert and Ernie, it seems, have the same contents.

According to these criticisms, the Twin Earth thought experiments seem to show that twins across planets, or in those raised in different linguistic communities, establish differing contents by importing questionable assumptions such as; that the causal theory of reference is true, that we refer to hidden structural properties, or dictate norms for ascribing contents. Without these assumptions, the Twin Earth thought experiments can easily invoke internalist intuitions. When experimental philosophers tested such thought experiments, they elicited different intuitions. At the very least, these philosophers say, “intuitions about cases continue to underdetermine the selection of the correct theory of reference” (Machery, Mallon, Nichols, and Stich 2009, 341).

4. Two Problems for Content Externalism

a. Privileged Access

René Descartes famously insisted that he could not be certain he had a body: “…if I mean only to talk of my sensation, or my consciously seeming to see or to walk, it becomes quite true because my assertion refers only to my mind.” In this view, privileged access (that is, a priori knowledge) to our content would seem to be true.

However, as Paul Boghossian has argued, externalism may not be able to honor this apparent truism. Boghossian imagines that we earthlings have slowly switched from Earth to Twin Earth, unbeknownst to us. As a result, he proposes that the externalist theory would not allow for discernment of whether contents refer to water or twater, to arthritis or tharthritis (Boghossian 1989, 172; Boghossian 1994, 39). As Burge sees the challenge, the problem is that "…[a] person would have different thoughts under the switches, but the person would not be able to compare the situations and note when and where the differences occurred (Burge 1988, 653; Burge 1998, 354; Burge 2003a, 278).

Boghossian argues that since externalism seems to imply that we cannot discern whether our contents refer to water or twater, arthritis or tharthritis, then we do not have privileged access to the proper contents. Either the approach for understanding privileged access is in need of revision (for example, restricting the scope of our claims to certain a priori truths), or externalism is itself false.

In response, Burge and others claim the “enabling conditions” (for example, of having lived on Earth or Twin Earth) to have water or twater, arthritis or tharthritis, the referential contents need not be known. As long as the enabling conditions are satisfied, first-order contents can be known (for example, “that is water” or “I have arthritis”); this first-order knowledge gives rise to our second-order reflective contents about them. Indeed, our first-order thoughts (that is, about objects) completely determine the second-order ones (Burge 1988, 659). However, as Max de Gaynesford and others have argued, when considering switching cases, one cannot assume that such enabling conditions are satisfied. Since we may be incorrect about such enabling conditions, and may be incorrect about our first-order attitude contents as well, then we may be incorrect about our reflective contents too (de Gaynesford 1996, 391).

Kevin Falvey and Joseph Owens have responded that although we cannot discern among first order contents, doing so is unnecessary. Although the details are “large and complex,” our contents are always determined by the environment where we happen to be, eliminating the possibility of error (Falvey and Owens 1994, 118). By contrast, Burge and others admit that contents are individuated gradually by “how the individual is committed” to objects. and that this commitment is constituted by other factors (Burge 1988, 652, Burge 1998, 352; Burge 2003a, 252). If we were suddenly switched from Earth to Twin Earth, or back again, our contents would not typically change immediately. Externalism, Burge concedes, is consistent with our having “wildly mistaken beliefs” about our enabling conditions (for example, about where we are) and so allows for errors about our first-order contents, as well as reflections upon them (Burge 2003c, 344). Because there is such a potential to be mistaken about enabling conditions, perhaps we do need to know them after all.

Other externalists have claimed that switching between Earth and Twin Earth is not a “relevant alternative”. Since such a switch is not relevant, they say, our enabling conditions (that is, conditions over time) are what we take them to be, such that we have privileged access to our first-order contents, and to our reflections on these (Warfield 1997, 283; Sawyer 1999, 371). However, as Peter Ludlow has argued, externalists cannot so easily declare switching cases to be irrelevant (Ludlow 1995, 48; Ludlow 1997, 286). As many externalists concede, relevant switching cases are easy to devise. Moreover, externalists cannot both rely on fictional Twin Earth thought experiments to generate externalist intuitions yet also object to equally fictional switching cases launched to evoke internalist intuitions. Either all such cases of logical possibility are relevant or none of them are (McCulloch 1995, 174).

Michael McKinsey, Jessica Brown and others offer another set of privileged access objections to externalism. According to externalism, they say, we do have privileged access to our contents (for example, to those expressed by water or twater, or arthritis or tharthritis). Given such access, we should be able to infer, by conceptual implication, that we are living in a particular environment (for example, on a planet with water and arthritis, on a planet twater and tharthritis, and so forth). Externalism, then, should afford us a priori knowledge of our actual environments (McKinsey 1991, 15; Brown 1995, 192; Boghossian 1998, 208). Since privileged access to our contents does not afford us a priori knowledge of our environments (the latter always remaining a posteriori), externalism implies that we possess knowledge we do not have.

Externalists, such as Burge, Brian McLaughlin and Michael Tye, Anthony Brueckner, and others have proposed that privileged access to our contents does not afford any a priori knowledge of our environments. Since we can be mistaken about natural kinds in our actual environment (for example, we may even discover that there are no kinds) the facts must be discovered. Actually, as long as objects exist somewhere, we can form contents about them just by hearing others theorize about them (Burge 1982, 114; Burge 2003c, 344; Brueckner 1992, 641; Gallois and O’Leary-Hawthorne 1996, 7; Ball 2007, 469). Although external items individuate contents, our privileged access to those contents does not afford us a priori knowledge of our environments (such details always remaining a posteriori). However, if we can form contents independent of the facts of our environment (for example, if we can have “x,” “y,” or “z” contents about x, y, or z objects when these objects have never existed around us), then externalism seems to be false in principle. Externalists must explain how this possibility does not compromise their position, or they must abandon externalism (Boghossian 1998, 210; Segal 2000, 32, 55; Besson 2012, 420).

Some externalists, Sarah Sawyer and Bill Brewer among them, have responded to this privilege access objection by suggesting that, assuming externalism is true, we can only think about objects by the causal interaction we have with them. Since this is so, privileged access to our contents allows us to infer, by conceptual implication, that those very objects exist in our actual environments. In other words, externalism affords us a priori knowledge of our environments after all (Sawyer 1998, 529-531; Brewer 2000, 416). Perhaps this response is consistent, but it requires privileged access to our contents by itself determine a priori knowledge of our environments.

b. Mental Causation and Psychological Explanation

Jerry Fodor, Colin McGinn, offer a second objection to externalism based in scientific psychology. When explaining behavior, psychologists typically cite local contents as causes of our behavior. Psychologists typically ascribe twins the same mental causes and describe twins as performing the same actions (Fodor 1987, 30; McGinn 1982, 76-77; Jacob 1992, 208, 211). However, according to externalism, contents are individuated in relation to different distal objects. Since twins across planets relate to different objects, they have different mental causes, and so should receive different explanations. Yet as Fodor and McGinn note, since the only differences between twins across planets are the relations they bear to such objects, those objects are not causally relevant. As Jacob says, the difference between twin contents and behavior seems to drop out as irrelevant (Jacob 1992, 211). Externalism, then, seems to violate principles of scientific psychology, rendering mental causation and psychological explanation mysterious (Fodor 1987, 39; McGinn 1982, 77).

Externalists, such as Burge, Robert van Gulick, and Robert Wilson have responded that, when considering mental causation and psychological explanation, local causes are important. There is still good reason to individuate contents between planets by the relation twins bear to distal (and different) objects (Burge 1989b, 309; Burge 1995, 231; van Gulick 1990; 156; Wilson 1997, 141). Externalists have also noted that any relations we bear to such objects may yet be causally relevant to behavior, albeit indirectly (Adams, Drebushenko, Fuller, and Stecker 1990, 221-223; Peacocke 1995, 224; Williamson 2000, 61-64). However, as Fodor, Chalmers, and others have argued, our relations to such distal and different objects are typically not causal but only conceptual (Fodor 1991b 21; Chalmers 2002a, 621). Assuming this is so, psychologists do not yet have any reason to prefer externalist recommendations for the individuation of content, since these practices do not distinguish the causal from the conceptual aspects of our contents.

5. Different Kinds of Content Externalism

Historically, philosophers as diverse as Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, Martin Heidegger, and Ludwig Wittgenstein have all held versions of externalism. Putnam and Burge utilize Twin Earth thought experiments to argue for natural kind and social externalism, respectively, which they extend to externalism about artifacts, percepts, memories, and phenomenal properties. More recently, Gareth Evans and John McDowell, Ruth Millikan, Donald Davidson, Andy Clark and David Chalmers have developed four more types of externalism – which do not primarily rely upon Twin Earth thought experiments, and which differ in their motivations, scopes and strengths.

Gareth Evans, John McDowell adapt neo-Fregean semantics to launch a version of externalism for demonstrative thoughts (for example, this is my cat). In particular, we bear a “continuing informational link” to objects (for example, cats, tables, and so forth) where we can keep track of them, as manifested in a set of abilities (Evans 1982, 174). Without this continuing informational link and set of abilities, Evans says, we can only have “mock thoughts” about such objects. Such failed demonstrative thoughts appear to have contents, but in fact, do not (Evans 1981, 299, 302; McDowell 1986, 146; McCulloch 1989, 211-215). Evans and McDowell conclude that when we express demonstrative thoughts, our contents about them are individually dependent on the objects they represent. In response, some philosophers have questioned whether there is any real difference between our successful and failed demonstrative thoughts (that is, rendering the latter mock thoughts). Demonstrative thoughts, successful or not, seem to have the same contents and we seem to behave the same regardless (Segal 1989; Noonan 1991).

Other externalists – notably David Papineau and Ruth Garrett Millikan – employ teleosemantics to argue that contents are determined by proper causes, or those causes that best aid in our survival. Millikan notes that when thoughts are “developed in a normal way,” they are “a kind of cognitive response to” certain substances and that it is this process that determines content (Millikan 2004, 234). Moreover, we can “make the same perceptual judgment from different perspectives, using different sensory modalities, under different mediating circumstances” (Millikan 2000, 103). Millikan claims that improperly caused thoughts may feel the same as genuine thoughts, but have no place in this system. Therefore, contents are, one and all, dependent on only proper causes. However, some philosophers have responded that the prescribed contents can be produced in aberrant ways and aberrant contents can be produced by proper causes. Contents and their proper causes may be only contingently related to one another (Fodor 1990).

Donald Davidson offers a third form of externalism that relies on our basic linguistic contact with the world, on the causal history of the contents we derive from language, and the interpretation of those contents by others. Davidson insists that

…in the simplest and most basic cases, words and sentences derive their meaning from the objects and circumstances in whose presence they were learned (Davidson 1989, 44; Davidson, 1991; 197).

In such cases, we derive contents from the world directly; this begins a causal history where we can manifest the contents. An instantly created swampman – a being with no causal history – could not have the contents we have, or even have contents at all (Davidson 1987, 19). Since our contents are holistically related to each other as interpreters, we must find each other to be correct in most things. Interpretations, however, change what our contents are and do so essentially (Davidson 1991, 211). Davidson concludes that our contents are essentially dependent on our basic linguistic contact with the world, our history of possessing such contents, and on how others interpret us. In response, some philosophers have argued that simple basic linguistic contact with the world, from which we derive specific contents directly, may not be possible. A causal history may not be relevant to our having contents and the interpretations by others may have nothing to do with content (Hacker 1989; Leclerc 2005).

Andy Clark and David Chalmers have developed what has been called “active externalism,” which addresses the vehicles of content – our brains. When certain kinds of objects (for example, notebooks, mobile phones, and so forth) are engaged to perform complex tasks, the objects change the vehicles of our contents as well as how we process information. When processing information, we come to rely upon objects (for example, phones), such that they literally become parts of our minds, parts of our selves (Clark and Chalmers 1998; Clark 2010). Clark and Chalmers conclude that our minds and selves are “extended” insofar as there is no boundary between our bodies, certain objects, and our social worlds. Indeed, other externalists have broadened active or vehicle externalism to claim that there are no isolated persons at all (Noe 2006; Wilson 2010). Philosophers have suggested various ways to draw a boundary between the mind and objects, against active or vehicle externalism (Adams and Aizawa 2010). Other philosophers have responded that because active or vehicle externalism implies that the mind expands to absorb objects, it is not externalism at all (Bartlett 2008).

These newer forms of externalism do not rely on Twin Earth thought experiments. Moreover, these forms of externalism do not depend on the causal theory of reference, reference to hidden structural properties, incomplete understanding, or dictated norms for ascribing content. Consequently, these newer forms of externalism avoid various controversial assumptions in addition to any problems associated with them. However, even if one or more of these externalist approaches could overcome their respective objections, all of them, with the possible exception of active or vehicle externalism (which is not universally regarded as a form of externalism) must still face the various problems associated with privileged access, mental causation, and psychological explanation.

6. Content Internalism and Narrow Content

Internalism proposes that our contents are individuated by the properties of our bodies (for example, our brains), and these alone. According to this view, our contents locally supervene on the properties of our bodies. In the history of philosophy, René Descartes, David Hume, and Gottlob Frege have defended versions of internalism. Contemporary internalists typically respond to Twin Earth thought experiments that seem to evoke externalist intuitions. Internalists offer their own thought experiments (for example, brain in a vat experiments) to invoke internalist intuitions. For example, as David Chalmers notes, clever scientists could arrange a brain such that it has

...the same sort of inputs that a normal embodied brain receives…the brain is connected to a giant computer simulation of the world. The simulation determines which inputs the brain receives. When the brain produces outputs, these are fed back into the simulation. The internal state of the brain is just like that of a normal brain (Chalmers 2005, 33).

Internalists argue that such brain in vat experiments are coherent; they contend that brains would have the same contents as they do without their having any causal interaction with objects. It follows that neither brains in vats nor our contents are essentially dependent on the environment (Horgan, Tienson and Graham 2005; 299; Farkas 2008, 285). Moderate internalists, such as Jerry Fodor, Brian Loar, and David Chalmers, who accept Twin Earth inspired externalist intuitions, insofar as they agree that some contents are broad (that is, some contents are individuated by our causally interacting with objects). However, these philosophers also argue that some contents are narrow (that is, some contents depending only on our bodies) Radical internalists, such as Gabriel Segal, reject externalist intuitions altogether and argue that all content is narrow.

Moderate and radical internalists are classed as internalists because they all develop accounts of narrow content, or attempt to show how contents are individuated by the properties of our bodies. Although these accounts of narrow content differ significantly, they are all designed to have particular features. First, narrow content is intended to mirror our perspective, which is the unique set of contents in each person, regardless of how aberrant these turn out to be. Second, narrow content is intended to mirror our patterns of reasoning – again regardless of aberrations. Third, narrow content is intended to be relevant to mental causation and to explaining our behavior, rendering broad content superfluous for that purpose (Chalmers 2002a, 624, 631). As internalists understand narrow content, then, our unique perspective, reasoning, and mental causes are all important – especially when we hope to understand the precise details of ourselves and our fellows.

a. Jerry Fodor and Phenomenological Content

In his early work, Jerry Fodor developed a version of moderate internalism. Fodor concedes that the Twin Earth thought experiments show that some of our contents (for example, water or twater) are broad. Still, for the purposes of scientific psychology, he argues, we must construct some content that respects “methodological solipsism,” which in turn explains why the twins are psychologically the same. Consequently, Fodor holds that narrow content respects syntax, or does so “without reference to the semantic properties of truth and reference” (Fodor 1981, 240; Fodor 1982, 100). Phenomenologically, the content of “water is wet” is something like "…a universally quantified belief with the content that all the potable, transparent, sailable-on…and so forth, kind of stuff is wet (Fodor 1982, 111)." However, soon after Fodor offered this phenomenological version of narrow content, many philosophers noted that if such content by itself has nothing to do with truth or reference it is hard to see how this could be content, or how it could explain our behavior (Rudder-Baker 1985, 144; Adams, Drebushenko, Fuller, and Stecker 1990, 217).

Fodor responded by slightly changing his position. According to his revised position, although narrow content respects syntax, contents are functions, or “mappings of thoughts and contexts onto truth conditions” (for example, the different truth conditions that obtain on either planet). In other words, before we think any thought in context we have functions that determine that when we are on one planet we have certain contents and when on the other we will have different ones. If we were switched with our twin, our thoughts would still match across worlds (Fodor 1987, 48). However, Fodor concedes, independent of context, we cannot say what narrow contents the twins share (that is, across planets). Still, he insists that we can approach these contents, albeit indirectly (Fodor 1987, 53). In other words, we can use broad contents understood in terms of “primacy of veridical tokening of symbols” and then infer narrow contents from them (Fodor 1991a, 268). Fodor insists that while twins across worlds have different broad contents, they have the same narrow functions that determine these contents.

But as Robert Stalnaker, Ned Block, and others have argued, if narrow contents are but functions that map contexts of thoughts onto truth conditions, they do not themselves have truth conditions – arguably, they are not contents. Narrow content, in this view, is just syntax (Stalnaker 1989, 580; Block 1991, 39, 51). Even if there was a way to define narrow content so that it would not reduce to syntax, it would still be difficult to say what about the descriptions must be held constant for them to perform the function of determining different broad contents on either planet (Block 1991, 53). Lastly, as Paul Bernier has noted, even if we could settle on some phenomenological descriptions to be held constant across planets, we could not know that any tokening of symbols really did determine their broad contents correctly (Bernier 1993, 335).

Ernest Lepore, Barry Loewer, and others have added that even if narrow contents could be defined as functions that map thoughts and contexts onto truth conditions, and even if these were short phenomenological descriptions, parts of the descriptions (for example, water or twater “…is wet,” or arthritis or tharthritis “…is painful” and so forth) might themselves be susceptible to new externalist thought experiments. If we could run new thought experiments on terms like “wet” or “painful,” those terms may not be narrow (Lepore and Loewer 1986, 609; Rowlands 2003, 113). Assuming that this is possible, there can be no way to pick out the truly narrow component in such descriptions, rendering this entire account of narrow content hopeless.

In the early 21st century, proponents of “phenomenal intentionality” defended this phenomenological version of narrow content. Experience, these philosophers say, must be characterized as the complex relation that “x presents y to z,” where z is an agent. In other words, agents are presented with various apparent properties, relations, and so forth, all with unique feels. Moreover, these presentations can be characterized merely by using “logical, predicative, and indexical expressions” (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 2005, 301). These philosophers insist the phenomenology of such presentations is essential to them, such that all who share them also share contents. Phenomenal intentionality, then, is narrow (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 2005, 302; Horgan and Kriegel 2008, 360). Narrow contents, furthermore, have narrow truth conditions. The narrow truth conditions of “that picture is crooked” may be characterized as "…there is a unique object x, located directly in front of me and visible by me, such that x is a picture and x is hanging crooked (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 2005, 313)."

Defenders of phenomenological intentionality insist that although it is difficult to formulate narrow truth conditions precisely, we still share them with twins and brains in vats – although brains will not have many of their conditions satisfied (Horgan, Tienson, and Graham 315; Horgan 2007, 5). Concerning the objections to this account, if phenomenology is essential to content, there is little worry that content will reduce to syntax, about what part of content should be held constant across worlds, or about new externalist thought experiments. Externalists, of course, argue that phenomenology is not essential to content and that phenomenology is not narrow (Lycan 2001; Tye 2008; Ellis 2010). Because proponents of phenomenological intentionality hold that phenomenology is essential to content, they can respond that such arguments beg the question against them.

b. Brian Loar and David Chalmers on Conceptual Roles and Two-Dimensional Semantics

Brian Loar, David Chalmers, and others have developed another version of moderate internalism. Loar and Chalmers concede that the Twin Earth thought experiments show that some contents are broad (for example, water, twater or arthritis, tharthritis, and so forth), but also argue that our conceptual roles are narrow. Conceptual roles, these philosophers say, mirror our perspective and reasoning, and are all that is relevant to psychological explanations.

Conceptual roles, Colin McGinn notes, can be characterized by our “subjective conditional probability function on particular attitudes. In other words, roles are determined by our propensity to “assign probability values” to attitudes, regardless of how aberrant these attitudes turn out to be (McGinn 1982 234). In a famous series of articles, Loar adds that we experience such roles subjectively as beliefs, desires, and so forth. Such subjective states, he says, are too specific to be captured in public discourse and only have “psychological content,” or the content that is mirrored in how we conceive things (Loar 1988a, 101; Loar 1988b, 127). When we conceive things in the same way (for example, as twins across worlds do), we have the same contents. When we conceive things differently (for example, when we have different evaluations of a place), we have different contents. However, Loar admits that psychological contents do not themselves have truth conditions but only project what he calls “realization conditions,” or the set of possible worlds where contents “…would be true,” or satisfied (Loar 1988a, 108; Loar 1988b, 123). Loar concedes that without truth conditions psychological contents may seem odd, but they are narrow. In other words, psychological contents project realization conditions and do so regardless of whether or not these conditions are realized (Loar 1988b, 135).

David Chalmers builds on this conceptual role account of narrow content but defines content in terms of our understanding of epistemic possibilities. When we consider certain hypotheses, he says, it requires us to accept some things a priori and to reject others. Given enough information about the world, agents will be “…in a position to make rational judgments about what their expressions refer to” (Chalmers 2006, 591). Chalmers defines scenarios as “maximally specific sets of epistemic possibilities,” such that the details are set (Chalmers 2002a, 610). By dividing up various epistemic possibilities in scenarios, he says, we assume a “centered world” with ourselves at the center. When we do this, we consider our world as actual and describe our “epistemic intensions” for that place, such that these intentions amount to “…functions from scenarios to truth values” (Chalmers 2002a, 613). Epistemic intensions, though, have epistemic contents that mirror our understanding of certain qualitative terms, or those terms that refer to “certain superficial characteristics of objects…in any world” and reflect our ideal reasoning (for example, our best reflective judgments) about them (Chalmers 2002a, 609; Chalmers 2002b, 147; Chalmers 2006, 586). Given this, our “water” contents are such that "If the world turns out one way, it will turn out that water is H20; if the world turns out another way, it will turn out that water is XYZ" (Chalmers 2002b, 159).

Since our “water” contents constitute our a priori ideal inferences, the possibility that water is XYZ may remain epistemically possible (that is, we cannot rule it out a priori). Chalmers insists that given this background, epistemic contents really are narrow, because we evaluate them prior to whichever thoughts turn out to be true, such that twins (and brains in vats) reason the same (Chalmers 2002a, 616; Chalmers 2006, 596). Lastly, since epistemic contents do not merely possess realization conditions or conditions that address “…what would have been” in certain worlds but are assessed in the actual world, they deliver “epistemic truth conditions” for that place (Chalmers 2002a, 618; Chalmers 2002b, 165; Chalmers 2006, 594). Epistemic contents, then, are not odd but are as valuable as any other kind of content. In sum, Chalmers admits that while twins across worlds have different broad contents, twins (and brains) still reason exactly the same, and must be explained in the same way. Indeed, since cognitive psychology “…is mostly concerned with epistemic contents” philosophy should also recognize their importance (Chalmers, 2002a, 631).

However, as Robert Stalnaker and others have argued, if conceptual roles only have psychological contents that project realization conditions, we can best determine them by examining broad contents and then extracting narrow contents (Stalnaker 1990, 136). If this is how we determine narrow contents, they are merely derivative and our access to them is limited. However, Stalnaker says, that if psychological contents have actual truth conditions, then they are broad (Stalnaker 1990, 141). Chalmers, though, has responded that on his version of the position, our a priori ideal evaluations of epistemic possibilities in scenarios yields epistemic intensions with epistemic contents, and these contents have epistemic truth conditions of their own. Given these changes, he says, the problems of narrow content do not arise for him. Still, as Christian Nimtz and others have argued, epistemic contents seem merely to be qualitative descriptions of kinds, and so fall victim to typical modal and epistemological objections to descriptivist theories of reference (Nimtz 2004, 136). Similarly, as Alex Byrne and James Pryor argue, because such descriptions do not yield “substantive identifying knowledge” of kinds, it is doubtful we can know what these contents are, or even that they exist (Byrne and Pryor 2006, 45, 50). Lastly, other externalists have responded that the qualitative terms we use to express capture epistemic contents must be semantically neutral. However, since such neutral terms are not available, such contents are beyond our ken (Sawyer 2008, 27-28).

Chalmers has responded that although epistemic contents can be phrased descriptively, “there is no reason to think that grasping an epistemic intension requires any sort of descriptive articulation by a subject” (Chalmers 2002b, 148). Since this is so, he says, theory is not committed to the description theory of reference. Similarly, Chalmers insists that as long as we have enough information about the world, we do not require substantive identifying knowledge of kinds, but only “…a conditional ability” to identify them (Chalmers 2006, 600). Some philosophers have postulated that repeated contact with actual or hypothetical referents may change and refine it, and others have suggested that this ability may include abductive reasoning (Brogaard 2007, 320). However, Chalmers denies that this objection applies to his position because the conditional ability to identify kinds concerns only our ideal reasoning (for example, our best reflective judgments). Chalmers concedes that our qualitative language must be semantically neutral, but he insists that once we have enough information about the world, “…a qualitative characterization… will suffice” (Chalmers 2006, 603). Such a characterization, he says, will guarantee that twins (and brains in vats) have contents with the same epistemic truth conditions.

c. Radical Internalism

Unlike moderate internalists such as Fodor, Loar, and Chalmers, Gabriel Segal makes the apparently radical move of rejecting Twin Earth inspired externalist intuitions altogether (Segal, 2000, 24). Radical internalism offers the virtues of not needing to accommodate externalism, and of avoiding typical criticisms of narrow content. Internalists, Segal says, are not required to concede that some of our contents are broad and then to develop versions of narrow contents as phenomenology, epistemic contents, or conceptual roles beyond this. Indeed, he insists that this move has always been an “unworkable compromise” at best (Segal 2000, 114). Rather, as Segal says, narrow content is…a variety of ordinary representation” (Segal 2000, 19).

Segal notes that when offering Twin Earth thought experiments, externalists typically assume that the causal theory of reference is true, that we refer to hidden structural properties, can have contents while incompletely understanding them, and assume tendentious norms for ascribing contents. Moreover, Segal says, externalists seem unable to account for cases of referential failure (for example, cases of scientific failure), and so their account of content is implausible on independent grounds (Segal 2000, 32, 55). When all this is revealed, he says, our intuitions about content can easily change, and do. Interpreted properly, in this view, the Twin Earth thought experiments do not show that our contents are broad, but rather reveals “psychology, as it is practiced by the folk and the scientist, is already, at root, internalist” (Segal 2000, 122).

Segal describes our narrow contents as “motleys,” or organic entities that can “persist through changes of extension” yet still evolve. Motleys “…leave open the possibility of referring to many kinds,” depending on the circumstances (Segal 2000, 77, 132). Although Segal disavows any general method for determining when contents change or remain the same, he insists that we can employ various charitable means to determine this. When there is any mystery, we can construct neologisms to be more accurate. Neologisms allow us to gauge just how much our fellows deviate from us, and even to factor these deviations out (Segal 2000, 141; Segal 2008, 16). Regardless of these details, motleys are shared by twins (and brains in vats). Segal suggests that we follow the lead of experimental psychologists who track the growth and changes in our concepts by using scientific methods and models, but who only recognize narrow contents (Segal 2000, 155).

Importantly, because Segal rejects Twin Earth inspired externalist intuitions, externalists cannot accuse his version of narrow content of not being content, or of being broad content in disguise, without begging the question against him. Still, as Jessica Brown has argued, his account is incomplete. Segal, she notes, assumes a neo-Fregean account of content which she paraphrases as

If S rationally assents to P (t1) and dissents from or abstains from the truth value of P (t2), where P is in an extensional context, then for S, t1 and t2 have different contents, and S associates different concepts with them (Brown 2002, 659).

Brown insists that Segal assumes this neo-Fregean principle, but “…fails to provide any evidence” for it (Brown 2002, 660). Given this lacuna in his argument, she says, externalists might either try to accommodate this principle, or to reject it outright. Externalists have done both. Although Segal does not explicitly defend this neo-Fregean principle, he begins an implicit defense elsewhere (Segal 2003, 425). Externalists, by contrast, have struggled to accommodate this neo-Fregean principle and those externalists who have abandoned it have rarely offered replacements (Kimbrough 1989, 480).

Because Segal bases his radical internalism on rejecting externalist intuitions altogether, its very plausibility rests on this. Externalists typically take their intuitions about content obvious and expect others to agree. Still, as Segal notes, although externalist intuitions are popular, it is reasonable to reject them. By doing this, he hopes to “reset the dialectical balance” between externalism and internalism (Segal 2000, 126). Radical internalism, he says, may not be so radical after all.

7. Conclusion

Externalism and internalism, as we have seen, address how we individuate the content of our attitudes, or address what makes those contents what they are. Putnam, Burge, and other externalists insist that contents can be individuated by our causal interaction with the natural and social world. Externalists seem to incur problems of privileged access to our contents as well as problems about mental causation and psychological explanation. Externalist responses to these issues have been numerous, and have dominated the literature. By contrast, Chalmers, Segal, and other content internalists argue that contents can be individuated by our bodies. Internalists, though, have faced the charge that since narrow content does not have truth conditions, it is not content. Moreover, if such content does have truth conditions it is just broad content in disguise. Internalist responses to these charges have ranged from trying to show how narrow content is not vulnerable to these criticisms, to suggesting that the externalist intuitions upon which the charges rest should themselves be discarded.

Externalists and internalists have very different intuitions about the mind. Externalists seem unable to imagine minds entirely independent of the world (repeatedly claiming that possibility revises our common practices, or is incoherent in some way). By contrast, internalists see the split between mind and world as fundamental to understanding ourselves and our fellows, and so concentrate on questions of perspective, reasoning, and so forth. Given the contrasting intuitions between externalists and internalists, both sides often mischaracterize the other and see the other as clinging to doubtful, biased, or even incoherent conventions. Unless some way to test such intuitions is developed, proponents of both sides will continue to cleave to their assumptions in the debate, convinced that the burden of proof must be borne by the opposition.

8. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Basil Smith
Saddleback College
U. S. A.

Roger Bacon: Language

Western medieval philosophers and theologians spent a great deal of effort thinking about the nature of language. Notwithstanding their debt to their ancient forerunners, authors like Peter Abelard, Boethius of Dacia, and William of Ockham contributed a wide variety of innovative ideas and theories to the field of linguistics. During the time of the so-called ‘modern logic,’ the work of Roger Bacon (1214/20 —1292) is particularly noteworthy. He worked in this area from the beginning of his professional career (as a Master of Arts in Paris in the 1240’s) until the end of his life (in the Franciscan convent in Oxford). He left behind a prodigious amount of research, much of which still awaits critical examination. Bacon’s work in the field of language is also remarkable with respect to the wide range of themes and issues he covered. In his work, he either extensively covered or at least touched on issues representing the whole of the disciplines of the Trivium (grammar, dialectic, rhetoric), spanning from speculative grammar and semantics to semiotics and evolutionary linguistics. In his linguistic work, however, Bacon was primarily interested in practical ends, in the ways in which the study of language can aid in matters of divine and human wisdom. While many of his writings were composed with an eye towards theological questions such as biblical exegesis, he also considered pedagogical, ethical and political aspects of language, such as how language can be used to convert infidels or provide moral order for society.

In his work on language, Bacon would oftentimes present unorthodox positions. His semantic theory on univocal appellation and his emphasis on the importance of metaphor and the intention of the speaker in everyday communication – the so-called ‘pragmatic approach’ – distinguish him from many of his contemporaries. In addition, Bacon is probably the most important medieval theorist of signs, laying out a comprehensive classification of signs as well as a conception of signification and linguistic signs. Here as well he espoused an uncommon view. According to Bacon, a sign is essentially a relational thing, dependent on the relation between sign and sign-interpreter. Moreover, Bacon’s work on semiotics is notable for his insistence that things rather than their concepts are the principal significates of words. Together with the work of Dante Alghieri (1265-1321), Bacon’s work on language stands out in virtue of his observations on the evolution of languages. Lastly, Bacon’s linguistic work is noteworthy in virtue of his having stated the basic principle of universal grammar, that is, the principle that there is only one grammar for all languages.

This article gives an overview of Bacon’s contributions to the study of language. It focuses on Bacon’s intentionalist approach in speculative grammar, as well as his contributions to the fields of semantics, semiotics, evolutionary linguistics and universal grammar. Lastly, it considers some of Bacon’s considerations concerning pedagogical aspects of languages.

Table of Contents

  1. General Remarks
    1. Bacon’s Division of the Trivium
  2. Speculative Grammar
    1. Bacon’s Method in Speculative Grammar
    2. Bacon’s Intentionalism
  3. Logical Semantics
    1. Bacon’s Doctrine of the Production of Speech
    2. Bacon’s Doctrine of Univocal Appellation
  4. Semiotics and Semantics
    1. General Remarks
    2. The Definition of Sign and Signification
    3. The Classification of Signs
    4. Semantic Analyses within a Semiotic Context: Imposition, Analogy, and Connotation
  5. Languages
    1. Language Groups and Functions
    2. Bacon’s Formulation of the Universal Principle of Grammar
    3. Philology within Bacon’s Program for the Reform of Learning
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. 1240’s-1250’s
      2. 1250’s-1268: Papal Opera
      3. 1268-1292
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. General Studies on Medieval Theories of Language
      2. On Roger Bacon’s Philosophy of Language

1. General Remarks

For several reasons, the medievals devoted much effort to the development of the skills necessary for the interpretation of texts. One reason for this was that knowledge in secular and divine matters predominantly came from books, which oftentimes needed to be translated and always required explanation and interpretation. Another reason was that medieval learning was essentially a commentary tradition, with most of the writings being commentaries on what were taken to be canonical texts (for example, the Scriptures or the works of Aristotle). In common with his fellow-logicians and grammarians, Bacon attached great value to issues pertaining to the disciplines of the Trivium (grammar, logic, and rhetoric), and he contributed to many important areas such as semantics, semiotics, and philology as well as to the question of the place of language studies within institutions of higher learning and society as a whole.

The emphasis these authors placed on logical, semantic, grammatical, and syntactic questions was in part due to the fact that after the end of Antiquity of all the branches of ancient philosophy, logic, grammar, and rhetoric remained on the agenda in secular as well as theological discussions. The particular emphasis that Bacon placed on the study of speech and languages, though, was not only theoretical. His interest in understanding language and mastering foreign languages like Hebrew and Greek was also motivated by his belief in the eminent practical importance of the study of speech and language for (1) ecclesiastical functions, (2) the reform of knowledge, (3) the conversion of infidels, and (4) the battle against the Antichrist.

During Bacon’s time, the scope of philosophical material increased considerably due to the translation of textbooks previously unavailable in Latin. The Aristotelian Organon together with the Metaphysics, Physics, and On the Soul (among other works) turned out to be a fruitful source of inspiration which triggered the development of a wide and complex variety of debates and approaches towards solving problems of many kinds. Many of the problems surrounding logic and language dealt with fallacies of equivocation. Grammatical discussions about semantics favoring a contextual approach to reference were connected to the logical problem of equivocation and thereby formed the high point (1175-1250) of a movement called “terminism” (and the approach called logica moderna or “terminist logic”), so called because of the emphasis on terms and their properties. This theory of the properties of terms – such as supposition, appellation, ampliation, and restriction – was the foundation of medieval semantic theory. Within this framework (and in particular, within the context of the controversial debates between Parisian and Oxford logicians), Bacon developed his own, sometimes original ideas on reference, meaning, and equivocation. The controversies between the Oxford and Parisian traditions on the various properties of terms remained an important point of reference for Bacon to which he returned in various writings. His writings on logical and semantic questions spanned different literary genres (including for example university textbooks and independent treatises), and his solutions to these problems are therefore scattered in many works. The fact that Bacon more or less consistently devoted himself to the study of logic and grammar over a period of almost fifty years demonstrates how important Bacon considered these debates to be (especially in relation to theology and religion in his later works).

In his work on linguistic and philological matters one can distinguish between two different stages. In the first stage are included Bacon’s contributions to the problem of universal quantification in the Summa de Sophismatibus et Distinctionibus (SSD), and to semantic problems revolving around the properties of terms in the Summulae Dialectices (SD); in particular the problem of univocal appellation and predication in regards to what are called ‘empty classes.’ Bacon’s solutions (especially to the semantic problems) provide the theoretical background against which Bacon continued to develop his doctrines during the second stage of his work on logic and linguistic matters. In this second stage, represented by the De Signis (DS) and the Compendium Studii Theologiae (CST), Bacon’s reflections on analogy were noteworthy as were his theories on the imposition of signs and, related to this, on the definition and classification of signs. The DS contains material on semiotics that was originally a part of the third part of the Opus Maius (“On the Utility of the Study of Language”), and that was discovered only recently and edited in 1978. The application of Bacon’s semiotics to theology, though – in which he intended to study sacraments as signs – remains lost. The CST represents a later adjustment of the material brought forth in the DS.

a. Bacon’s Division of the Trivium

Generally speaking, Bacon’s understanding of the nature and division of the disciplines of the Trivium (grammar, dialectic or logic, rhetoric) was quite different from that of his contemporaries and in certain respects richer. According to Bacon, rhetoric belongs to moral philosophy in that it represents the part of the practical branch of moral philosophy that is concerned with putting moral philosophy into practice: he considered rhetoric to be the art of speaking in such a manner that would motivate people to act morally. Bacon subordinated grammar to music (For Bacon’s views on music see van Deusen, 1997). Furthermore, grammar was not restricted to the study of the then-classical works on grammar by Priscian or Donatus; in Bacon’s view, grammar should first encompass the traditional elementary teaching of Latin, should then proceed to the study of the universal principles of language – a genre called ‘speculative grammar’ – and should eventually culminate in the mastery of languages, especially the languages of the Bible. Lastly, Bacon’s understanding of the place and nature of logic also differed from that of his contemporaries. Despite Bacon’s notoriety for his invectives against the “sins” infesting university studies – among which he included logic – Bacon still recommended a certain kind logic to be practiced. More specifically, according to Bacon, because there is no need for a science which treats of and teaches the rules of rational argumentation (and which, in virtue of this role, should occupy an eminent rank among the sciences) largely because logic is a basic capacity that is innate to humans, consisting in the ability to think rationally and to make arguments. In short, logic, according to Bacon, is not the “science of sciences” but rather a basic capability that needed to be made explicit rather than taught. Contrary to his contemporaries (including William of Sherwood, for example, who regarded logic to be a normative discipline that taught veritable speaking and helped to avoid false speaking), Bacon conceived logic to be a descriptive discipline. Logic, according to Bacon, makes explicit and describes the formal rules of argumentation that we already use (OT, ch. xxviii, 102f.). This explains why Bacon, in his works on logic, did not practice logic under the aspect of formal reasoning. Instead, he practiced logic under the aspect of its potential for solving problems arising from fallacies by emphasizing the role of context (“contextual approach”). In particular, Bacon was interested in the fallacy of equivocation and examined it extensively in his De Signis and Compendium Studii Theologiae.

2. Speculative Grammar

One of the accomplishments of medieval grammarians was to have significantly extended the original scope of the disciplines represented in the canonical works on grammar by Priscian and Donatus. Within the University setting, grammar along with other philosophical disciplines was expected to meet the requirements of Aristotelian science, which called for an identification of universal and necessary features of language that could become the subject of a scientific grammar. Grammar was thus considered to be a scientific and speculative, that is, theoretical endeavor: its goal was not only to teach the Latin language or to engage in literary analysis of Latin language and literature, but, in addition, to explain the nature and organization of language in terms of its causes and universal features within a purely theoretical framework (hence the name theoretical or ‘speculative grammar’). From a historical point of view, though, the Latin name grammatica speculativa was used exclusively by and for the ‘modist’ grammar of the late thirteenth and fourteenth centuries (called ‘modist’ because of the central role of the concept of the way or mode of signification – modus significandi – of this grammatical and semantic theory). The standard name for this theory today is ‘modism.’

Bacon wrote on speculative grammar – yet not always approvingly.Although during his time as Parisian Master of Arts Bacon formulated an intentionalist grammar – ‘intentionalist’ because Bacon emphasized the role of the signifying intention of the speaker (intentio proferentis) in answer to the question of the causes of language – he did not approve of the fully developed modistic doctrine of meaning which held that changes of meaning are imported by features based on the grammatical categories of nouns, verbs, cases, or tenses. Bacon preferred to explain all differences of meaning as cases of equivocation and he emphasized the importance the context had for the meaning of an utterance (DS, §§143-161; see Fredborg, 1981). As far as the study of the causes of language was concerned, the later Bacon very explicitly excluded grammar from any consideration of its principles and causes, and delegated their investigation to metaphysics and music instead. In his Opus Maius, Bacon delegated the study of causes and principles to music, and in his Opus Tertium he stated that “The grammarian is to the musician as the carpenter is to the geometer,” in the sense that the grammarian described the phenomena of the length and accents of letters and syllables which the musician studied from a causal perspective (OT, ch. lix, 231).
Despite these comments, Bacon’s early statements about grammar suggest that Bacon was himself a proponent of speculative grammar, at least originally. His earliest involvement with grammatical issues was in his early work Summa Grammatica (SG). The SG was a work typical for the Parisian arts faculty insofar as it was a supplement to the mandatory commentaries on one of the traditional canonical texts on grammar: Priscian’s Institutiones Grammaticae. More specifically, the SG is a supplement to commentaries on Priscian Minor and therefore deals with the principles of the “construction” of sentences (that is, the principles of syntax), by using sophismata (puzzling, odd or difficult sentences) as examples. The three parts of the SG represent rules and principles determining common and figurative sentence constructions, non-figurative constructions as well as adverbial constructions and liturgical formulae. In composing the SG, Bacon was deeply indebted to the most famous of the commentaries on Priscian Minor, that of his English colleague Robert Kilwardby (d. 1279) from whom he copied a considerable amount of content almost to the letter.

a. Bacon’s Method in Speculative Grammar

As was typical for speculative grammarians of that time, Bacon’s approach in the SG is guided by a principle taken from Aristotle’s Physics according to which “art imitates nature to the extent that it can” (Physics, II 2, 194 a21; SG 35, 4). Thus, within the context of the causal analysis of linguistic construction, grammatical art (re-)defines its own principles by beginning with nature. What this principle meant for Bacon’s analysis of syntactical function was that he, under the supposition that the process of constructing words was parallel to physical movement, studied grammatical construction alongside Aristotle’s analysis of movement in the fourth book of the Physics (Physics, IV 11, 219 4a21). Since a moving object, according to Physics, is moved from something (terminus a quo or principium) to something (terminus ad quem), so, in parallel manner, the verb of a sentence, signifying action and movement, needed two terms, a beginning from which it started and an end toward which it moved (SG, 65, 78). A grammatical category (like a case) was understood to be a property of an expression that allows it to function as a term of movement. Furthermore, Bacon laid out some very general rules for the combination of grammatical categories. In accordance with the principle that “nothing which is in movement can come to rest in something in movement, no movement being able to complete itself in something in movement,” Bacon deduced the argument why neither the participle nor the infinitive can occupy the function of the subject. The reason, according to Bacon, is that the character of both participle and infinitive is, by their verbal signification, too ‘unstable’ to function as a subject (SG, 60, 62). Bacon used a similar approach in regard to the topic of the organizing principle for the combination of terms. Take, for example, the dependence between adjective and its substantive: here the corresponding physical principle was that of dependence, in this particular case, between the accidental with regard to its subject (SG, 134, 143). However, as Bacon emphasized, art did not imitate nature in an absolute way but only “to the extent it can.” This meant that in those cases in which the physico-grammatical parallel reached its limits (in the sense that one ran into divergences in function), the grammarian needed to redefine the scope of this parallelism. The consequence of the limitations of the physico-grammatical parallel was that grammarians like Bacon sought inspiration regarding the functioning of grammar not only from the physical world but also from logic and other philosophical areas like epistemology.

b. Bacon’s Intentionalism

In regard to the analysis of the causes of linguistic construction, one other explanatory element arose from the realization of the role of the speaker, namely, the intention motivating a particular grammatical construction. Bacon shared this so-called intentionalist approach to grammar with many of his contemporaries, most notably with Robert Kilwardby. Generally speaking, Bacon’s analysis of linguistic construction and especially his adoption of the intentionalist approach in the SG was more or less common practice at that time. The principles of grammatical construction, according to the intentionalists, cannot be mechanically deduced from an application of rules alone; rather, one has to consider a voluntarist element in the form of the signifying intention of the speaker. According to Bacon, the truth value of a statement does not depend exclusively on its conformity with grammatical rules but, to an equal degree, on its adequateness with its signifying intention. In cases in which the speaker wishes to signify some particular idea, she is legitimately allowed to distance herself from the normal rules as for example in figurative speech, metaphors, or elliptic sentences: “It is not the sign which signifies but rather the speaker by means of the language – in the same way that it is not the stick which hits but he who uses it” (SSD, 153f.). In those ‘authorized’ variations in which statements do not conform to common usage (like in figures of speech), something is needed in order for them to be acceptable: namely, a legitimate justification in regard to a “reason which makes it possible” and a “reason which makes it necessary” (SG, 68, 133). Thus, the notion that language functions according to rules is found in both the common construction of sentences following normal rules and in the variations that are the result of the conscious and voluntary acts of a speaker (for a detailed account of Bacon’s and Kilwardby’s intentionalism see Rosier, 1994).
The later Bacon applied the above mentioned elements – (1) the intentionalist analysis of language and (2) the conception of language as an instrument for humans – in the context of his treatment of the (magical) power (potestas verborum) of spoken words. In his Opus Maius IV as well as his Opus Tertium and his Moralis Philosophia, Bacon was concerned with the issue of the “utility of grammar,” specifically, the issue of how spoken language works and is able to affect a listener’s soul. In addition to conceiving of the power of words as a physical process – along the doctrine of the multiplication of species (discussed below) – Bacon considered the intention of the speaker (among other elements) as an important factor in communication (OT, ch. xxvi, 96). Bacon utilized he principle of the rule-governed nature of language later in the semantic analyses he conducted in writings like the De Signis.

3. Logical Semantics

Recent research has begun to recognize the actual nature and extent of Bacon’s contributions to the field of semantics. Almost all of his writings in this field displayed originality to varying degrees, be that in the form of substantive solutions or in his approach toward the material. In his Summa de Sophismatibus et Distinctionibus (SSD), for example, Bacon contributed an important twofold thesis: first, a spoken statement had to be understood as a carrier of such information as was necessary for a listener to interpret it in a way that was in accordance with the speaker’s intention of conveying sense, and second, that the information contained in a sentence and the linguistic form it was presented in (especially the sequence of words) was sometimes not only insufficient but even an obstacle to a listener’s interpretation and the speaker’s intention (see Rosier and de Libera, 1986).

a. Bacon’s Doctrine of the Production of Speech

In his SSD Bacon challenged the semantic doctrine of “natural sense.” This doctrine was commonly held among 13th century logicians and revolved around the concept of “inclusion” (inclusio). The concept of inclusion was used in order to solve semantic problems arising from sentences containing several syncategorematic terms (‘all’ and ‘if,’ for example), or universal quantifiers. Sentences such as “omne animal est rationale vel irrationale” (“Every animal is rational or irrational”) allowed for two different interpretations. To decide whether what was meant was “Every animal is rational or every animal is irrational,” or “Every animal is rational or irrational,” Bacon’s fellow logicians argued that it was the sequence of words (ordo prolationis) in a sentence that contains the necessary semantic information. Bacon, however, chose a different strategy on how to solve the problem of universal quantification; he countered with his doctrine of the “production of speech” (generatio sermonis): it was not, as other logicians believed, that “the logical structure of sentences was contained in the linear sequence of the components of the sentence”; rather, as Bacon emphasized, it was necessary to consider the threefold division of the dimension linguistic communication: (1) the freedom of speaker and listener, (2) the nature of spoken language, and (3) restrictions of communication. Thus, in his argument against the doctrine of “natural sense,” Bacon stressed the relationship between the speaker and the listener. By taking into account the linguistic form chosen by the speaker and the sense provided by the listener, Bacon contributed the important consideration that decoding semantic information was interpretation: “In order to arrive at the intention of the speaker (intentio proferentis) it is necessary to bring in the concept of the production of speech (generatio sermonis).”

b. Bacon’s Doctrine of Univocal Appellation

Among some of Bacon’s other main contributions in the field of semantics was his insistence on the freedom of the will and the role of the speaker in the process of naming. Bacon put forward the notion that the significatory function of words is constituted through a relation to an external object rather than through a connection with a concept or representation in the mind of the speaker: Bacon considered things to be the significates of words rather than concepts – nowadays, this would have made him an externalist in semantics. In this context, Bacon advanced a unique doctrine in regard to the problem of equivocation, namely that by themselves names are names only of presently existing external things. He subsequently applied this theory to two issues: the first one was on inferences involving infinite, privative, and negative terms and the second issue was about the existential condition of the significates of names (the latter issue marked a recurring theme in Bacon’s scholarship) (see de Libera, 1981).
Bacon began his lifelong study of the problem of univocal appellation in his Summulae Dialectices when he criticized what was then considered to be the conventional wisdom on the matter: the view that it is possible to apply terms univocally to being and non-being – a theory called “natural supposition” (suppositio naturalis). In arguing against this theory, Bacon referred to the notion that being and non-being as well as the present and the past have nothing in common that would warrant the use of one and the same term – a notion that was strengthened by the fact that Bacon could point towards the authoritative support of Aristotle’s Metaphysics. “Some say that a term names present, past, and future things by itself, and that it is common to being and non-being. Others [though] say that a term is a name for present things only, and [that] nothing is common to being and non-being or the past, the present, and the future, according to what Aristotle states in the first book of Metaphysics” (SD, §§526-527). In his objection against the theory of natural supposition, Bacon focused his attention on the term ‘supposition’ and in his solution even resorted to grammatical concepts. While the Parisians, who argued in favor of natural supposition, believed that a term ‘supposited’ for all present, future, and possible entities outside the sentence, which in turn then constituted a term’s extension, Bacon pointed towards a term’s meaning and its original imposition (impositio) and held that supposition was to be understood as being in a sentence and, taken by itself, being restricted to present entities. Now although, according to Bacon, a term by itself (de se) could only concern those named in the present and although, in contrast, the past and the future were named only passingly, the term still could, as Bacon phrased it, be “extended” to include the past and the future through the verb’s tense. Thus, where the Parisians spoke of natural supposition and restriction (restrictio), Bacon’s response was to deny natural supposition and restriction and to affirm supposition for present entities (suppositio de se pro praesentibus) and ‘widening’ (ampliatio). Thus, from a more general point of view, Bacon’s doctrine of appellation was grounded in the distinction between two semantic perspectives: from a grammatical point of view (that of construction), and from a logical point of view (that of meaning). In other words, under the logical aspect, a noun only applies to present and existent entities, while under the grammatical aspect of a noun’s actual construction in a sentence (nomen constructionis) in combination with a verb, a noun could stand for past or future, that is, non-existent things. Hence, according to Bacon, it is the function of the verb in a sentence to establish a semantic relation to things past and future; verbs extend the supposition of nouns beyond their original imposition to present, existent entities. Verbs in present tense, however, do not contribute to the subject’s semantic relation to present, existent things since terms already possess this relation by themselves (SD, §§559-560).

4. Semiotics and Semantics

a. General Remarks

Roger Bacon was probably the most important theorist of signs in the medieval period, and his two semiological treatises, De Signis (DS) and the Compendium Studii Theologiae (CST), are among the most extensive semiotic treatises from this period. Generally speaking, his semiotics encompasses the definition and classification of signs (that is, modes in which a sign signifies or occurs), a theory of signification (including univocal, equivocal and analogical signification), as well as accounts of imposition and the so-called ‘semiotic triangle’ (a semiotic model that illustrates the relation between signs, concepts, and things). In a theoretical perspective, the three most prominent features of Bacon’s theory of signs are the semantics integrated into his classification of signs (and here especially his conception of natural signs), the notion of connotation (consignificatio) as a type of analogy, and his theory of imposition (impositio: the act of name-giving) (see Maloney, 1983a and 1984).
Many of the theses which Bacon defended in the DS (written around 1267) and the CST (written around 1292) involved the resumption of themes which he first introduced in his earlier writings on logic. By contrast, his semiotic works were neither a repetition nor a simple updating of older thoughts; rather, they contained contributions which responded to the debates going on at the respective times. In fact, Bacon remarked rather explicitly in DS that the lack of a theory of the imposition of words for signification (and the lack of a theory of the mechanics of signification) urged him to write the DS, in which the development of a theory of semantics (the signification of words – “signa quae significant ad placitum”), within a carefully developed semiotics, was the goal, and which was supposed to fill gaps and remedy errors in the logical and grammatical literature at that time (DS, §16, 86). In regard to his fellow sign theorists, Bacon deviated in many important points from the common opinions – for example, in regard to the issue of whether what should be considered essential for a sign’s existence was the relation of the sign to the intellect for whom it signified or the relation of the sign to what is signified, Bacon opted for the second answer – which, in many aspects, makes Bacon’s ideas on signs and semantics quite radical.
It should also be noted that Bacon intended both the DS and the CST to be considered from the point of view of theological application. A summary in Bacon’s Opus Tertium (OT, ch. xvii, 100-102) reveals that the DS must have contained a section about the application of the theory of signs to theology. As far as the CST is concerned, it was a treatise explicitly dealing with the reform of theological studies, in which Bacon summons the reader to turn towards the Scriptures and to investigate how signs are signified there – that is to say, to apply the theoretical section on semiotics and semantics to theological material (CST, §1, 32 and § 83, 82). It is commonly held that in both texts Bacon tried “to construct a general semantic and semiological doctrine on the basis of a tradition both theological and ‘artistic,’” or, in other words, to combine the two main semiotic traditions in the Middle Ages: Aristotelian semantics and Augustinian semiotics (Rosier-Catach, 1997, 98). Some interpreters have presented Bacon’s accomplishments in an even more pronounced form; they have said that Bacon’s concern with semiotics and semantics was directed at philosophical and theological ends, namely to improve scientific practice (which was mainly grounded in textual analysis) in both faculties. The instrument which Bacon thought should be used in order to achieve that goal was a semantic and semiotic analysis of language: an inquiry into the ways in which language worked, or did not work. His approach to philosophical and theological studies led some scholars to attribute an “analytic orientation” to Bacon’s reform efforts, which were ultimately directed at benefitting the whole of Christendom (De Libera, 1997, 120f; Perler, 2005).

b. The Definition of Sign and Signification

Bacon defined sign as “that, which offered to the senses or the intellect designates something to that intellect, because not every sign is offered to the senses as the common description assumes, but some [that is, mental concepts – passiones animae] are offered solely to the intellect […] therefore, they [mental concepts] are offered only to the intellect, [and] in this way they represent the external things themselves to that intellect” (DS, §2, 82). This view was a minority opinion in the thirteenth century in the sense that sign theorists commonly held an Augustinian, intensional definition of signs: the sign (a spoken phrase for example) stood for the thoughts of the speaker, which the sign’s recipient received through the senses which in turn represented it to the intellect. In writing that a sign was something that upon being “offered to the senses or the intellect represents itself to that intellect, since not every sign is offered to the senses,” Bacon meant that mental concepts themselves (passiones animae) were signs of things, which represented external things to the respective intellect. In other words, Bacon considered concepts as signs of the objects (DS, §166, 134). In the case of linguistic signs, spoken words for example, this meant that in accordance with the act of imposition – analogous to that of Baptism – words immediately referred to the things themselves.
A sign, according to Bacon, is in the category of relation “and is uttered essentially in reference to the one for whom it signifies” (DS, §1, 81). Signification, according to Bacon, entails four elements: the agency giving the sign, the sign itself, the significate (the thing a sign signifies), and the sign-interpreter. A sign was commonly considered to be a triadic relation (in the category relation), in regards to which the question arose regarding which of these relations was essential for the notion of a sign: the relation to the significate or to the sign-interpreter? The majority of theologians held that the primary relation of a sign is that to the thing signified and they thought this relation to be essential for the sign. In opposing Bonaventure’s (d. 1274) position (and that of other theologians of his time), Bacon reversed traditional opinion when he emphasized the priority of the ‘pragmatic’ relation of the sign to the sign-interpreter over the secondary relation to the significate (the thing signified): “Because if no one could conceive something through a [given] sign, it would be void and in vain, in fact, it wouldn’t be sign […] like the essence of the father remains when the son is dead, yet not the relation of fatherhood.” For a sign to be a sign it was required, according to Bacon, that it had an interpreter; the relation to the significate was secondary because ‘to signify’ is a relation, essentially and principally related to the one receiving the sign because it would be incorrect to infer that because “the sign is in act” that the significate is also in act, for nonentities can be signified by words just like entities” (DS, §1, 81f). Thus, signification is a relation established through communication to an interpreter: A wreath made of wine leaves above a tavern is only potentially a sign if nobody is there to interpret it as such and thereby render it actually a sign. This account also meant that the first relation of a sign (to the interpreter) determines the second relation (to the significate) which has consequences for the sign’s signification in the sense that it stresses the freedom of the one giving the sign with regard to its signification (see Maloney, 1983b and Rosier-Catach, 1997, 91-98).

c. The Classification of Signs

In the CST Bacon stated that he independently (per studium propriae inventionis) worked out the division between natural and given signs in his DS; and that, when he subsequently came across Augustine’s division in the second book of De Doctrina Christiana, he found it to be identical with his own (CST, §25, 56). In recent literature there has been considerable debate as to the degree of Bacon’s actual indebtedness to Augustine’s semiotics in the De Doctrina Christiana. Now even if Bacon was familiar with Augustine’s classification at the time he wrote the DS, it is clear that he did not simply copy it. Rather than to simply do this, Bacon integrated several sign typologies, including those from Augustine as well as from Aristotle and from theories of the sacramental sign, and this is precisely where his merit lies. For example, in the diagram given below, the first principal distinction between groups (I) and (II) corresponds to the De Doctrina Christiana, and groups (I.1-2) are of Aristotelian origin, with group (I.1) coming from the Analytics and Rhetorics, and group (I.2) coming from On Interpretation and On the Soul.
The division of signs proposed by Bacon in the opening paragraphs of DS is best represented schematically:
Signs (signa)

natural signs
signifiying by their own nature
(signa naturalia ex essentia sua)

given signs
sign from a soul
(signa ordinata ab anima, ex intentione animae recipiens rationem signi)
(I. 1) signifying necessarily or with probability because of inference, concomitance, consequence

(I.1.1) with regard to the past
(I.1.1.1) necessarily: having milk as a sign of motherhood
(I.1.1.2) with probability: the dampness of the soil being a sign for it having rained
(I.1.2) with regard to the present
(I.1.2.1) necessarily: cockcrow designating hour of the night
(I.1.2.2) with probability: motherhood designating love
(I.1.3) with regard to the future
(I.1.3.1) necessarily: rosy dawn designating sunrise
(I.1.3.2) with probability: redness of the sunset sky designating a bright morning
(I.2) signifying by configuration and likeness: images, pictures, and so forth.
(I.3) signifying by causality (because something has been effected by something as their cause): smoke designating fire, tracks designating an animal
(II.1) signifying conventionally, with imperfect or perfect deliberation in the mode of the concept (cum deliberatione rationis, ad placitum sive ex proposito)

(II.1.1) linguistic signs
(II.1.1.1) by way of imperfect deliberation: interjections such as ‘ahem’ and ‘ugh’
(II.1.1.2) by way of perfect deliberation: other parts of speech
(II.1.2) non-linguistic signs (language of gestures, monastic sign language, sign-boards, and so forth.)
(II.2) signifying naturall, instinctively, without deliberation in the mode of affect (subito et sine deliberatione, non ad placitum, per modum affectus)
(II.2.1) products of the sensitive soul: sounds emitted by animals and persons
(II.2.2) products of the rational soul: groans, exclamations, cries of pain, laughter, sighs
Bacon divided signs into two principal classes: he distinguished between signs that are natural (signa naturalia) and those that are given and directed by a soul (signa ordinata ab anima ad significandum) (DS, §3, 82). The principle of division into these two classes was built in the kind of agency that constituted something as a sign; thus, natural signs are natural because their being a sign does not depend on an act, an intention of soul but is grounded in their own essence: for smoke to designate fire it does not require a soul who makes it so but a soul only to acknowledge smoke as actually being a sign for fire. Natural signs, according to Bacon, signify by themselves and do not require a soul for intending them to signify (that is, to make a sign), whereas in the case of “signs given by a soul,” the reason why a thing is a sign is in virtue of its generating act, its originating from a soul’s intent. A linguistic sign (like an idiomatic phrase, for example) requires a deliberating and freely choosing intellect; a vocal sound like a moan uttered by a human being for example requires a soul: not a deliberating and freely choosing soul but one that “suddenly and without deliberation” utters a certain sound. The first principle class of natural signs is divided into three subclasses; of these, groups (I.1) and (I.2) are based on the significative relationship arising from inference or resemblance. Group (I.3) is based on the notion that causally related events are also related as sign and significate like smoke (effect-sign) is related to fire (cause-significate). Group (I.1.1-3) is built on the basis of the significate being contemporaneous with, following, or preceding its sign. Of these the first (I.1.1-3) signifies in virtue of a relation of necessary or probable consequence, that is, in virtue of the fact that one could be inferred from the other with either probability or necessity – for example, from the fact that a woman has milk, it could necessarily be inferred, in regard to the past, that she was a mother, hence a woman having milk is a sign of motherhood (DS, §§4-6, 82f.).
Insofar as the double use of the class ‘natural signs’ is concerned (that is, the first principal class of signs (I) and the second sub-mode of the second principal class of given signs (II.2)), Bacon introduced a new and original division. According to Bacon, both smoke designating fire and a sigh uttered by a person are ‘natural signs’ but for different reasons. A natural sign (signum naturalis) is called whatever is naturally or automatically related to something else, that is, whatever signifies something on its own (significat ex essentia sua) as opposed to a sign given by a soul, that is, a sign requiring intention in order to signify. However, into the class of natural signification Bacon also included another group of signs, yet he placed this group under the principal class of signs given from a soul (II.2). This group included products – that is, vocal sounds (voces) of the sensitive and rational soul (signa ordinata ab anima) – yet without being dependent on any convention, and being common to all persons (such as various expressions of feelings emitted by animals (II.2.1) and persons (II.2.2) like sighs, laughter, or moans). Previous theorists like Boethius attempted to exclude this group from the principal class of conventional signs, or “signifying at pleasure” (voces significativae ad placitum). Instead, Boethius and other commentators on Aristotle’s On Interpretation – the locus classicus for discussing signs “signifying at pleasure” – included them (products in group II.1) into the group of natural signs while Augustine in his De Doctrina Christiana II,4 suspended judgment about this issue altogether.
To this debate Bacon contributed the original solution that in the two cases of natural signs, for example smoke and a sigh, ‘natural’ had been used equivocally; in other words, in each case the name ‘natural’ corresponds with a different definition: smoke is not a natural sign in the same sense in which a sigh is a natural sign (DS, §14, 85). In the first case of natural signs as opposed to given signs (group I), ‘natural’ indicates the relation of signifying, whereas in the second case (II.2) ‘natural’ indicates that the sounds (voces) are produced by the agent (an animal or a person) spontaneously, that is, without deliberation or free choice but rather following a natural instinct, urge, and power of something acting naturally (DS, §8, 83). And, as he continued, when vocal sounds signifiy naturally (naturaliter), then they are natural signs (DS, §14, 85). This means that vocal sounds like a person’s sigh or a cat’s meow are a) signs and b) natural signs because in both cases they originate from a sensitive soul that constitutes and directs them with intent in order to communicate some awareness of something, for example a sensation of pain, pleasure or bewilderment. This is the reason why a vocal sound produced by an animal or a person falls under the class of signs that are given and directed by a soul with intent. Indeed, many years earlier, Bacon had already noted that non-rational animals were able to communicate with one another by means of signifying vocal sounds (voces significativae) (SD, II, §§19-26, 222f.). “Whenever a rational soul was only affected and in that way affected expresses itself without [prior] deliberation, then an articulated vocal sound signifies naturally” (DS, §11, 84). Bacon also used the concept of ‘natural sign’ in his explanation of connotation (consignificatio).

d. Semantic Analyses within a Semiotic Context: Imposition, Analogy, and Connotation

Theories of imposition deal with the issue of how linguistic signs signify, that is, how a word relates to a concept or refers to an external object. Since it has become common practice to apply modern philosophical paradigms to the respective medieval debates, modern scholars speak of medieval accounts of extensionalist and intensionalist theories of semantics. The theory of imposition that Bacon proposed in the DS has commonly been considered an extensionalist semantics (according to which terms solely designate existent objects), a “semantics of imposition” or a “semantics of reference” (De Libera, 1997, 128; Perler, 2005, 390f.). Bacon’s semantics revolves around the concept of imposition, and defends the view that the meaning of a word is established not through its relation to a mental concept but through its relation to an external and actually existing object. In defending this idea, Bacon went, as far as basic semantic commitments are concerned, against the sententia communis of his time (see Fredborg, 1981; Maloney, 1984, De Libera, 1997, 117-132).
In the context of theories of imposition, it was a central idea of Bacon’s that words designate things rather than mental concepts, and that words are coined to signify present objects. Naming, as Bacon stated, presupposes the momentary intuition of an actual object and the certainty that it was not corrupted or non-existent, which is why upon the singular object’s absence they are not being named anymore (DS, §25, 90f.). When the singular object designated by a word is absent or not existing anymore, according to Bacon, and we still use the word originally denoting that object, we have a case of a new use of the word, a new imposition; the meaning of a word is variable, that is, one word can, at different times, denote different objects, which describes the problem of equivocation.
With regard to imposition, Bacon distinguished between two modes. Bacon considered the first, “formal” mode of imposition (sub forma impositionis vocaliter expressa et assignata rei) to take place in a manner similar to Baptism, in which a name is applied to a child in virtue of a perlocutionary vocal expression like “I call you ‘Roger’.” On this view, a name is attributed to an object as a result of a vocally expressed form of imposing (DS, §154, 130). This first, formal mode of imposition, according to Bacon, refers to an act of explicitly inventing a new word, or to the situation of composing a language, and it is exclusive to skilled persons, with expertise in the art of name-giving (DS, §156-157, 131). The second mode of imposition (sine forma imponendi vocaliter expressa) occurs when a name is given not through a perlocutionary vocal expression but “within the intellect alone,” that is, when a name is imposed tacitly and without being explicitly announced, in regard to an object other than the one designated in the situation of first imposition, and at the pleasure of the impositor. This mode of imposition acknowledges the arbitrary freedom of any speaker in the sense that everybody – and not only experts – performs this mode of imposition; during our everyday use of language we make and renew significations without the vocally expressed form of imposing “because names signify at pleasure” (DS, §157, 131). For example, when a person sees the painted image of a human being for the first time, she would not perform the formal perlocutionary act of imposition, but would rather simply transfer the name ‘human’ to the image. Applying this idea to theological matters, Bacon argued that in the same way a person who says that God is just for the first time did not beforehand say “God’s essence is called justice,” but rather, based on resemblance, she transferred the name of human justice to God and pronounced it by herself and in her own mind. As a consequence for interpersonal communication, Bacon’s proposal that the signifying function of a word is variable in its scope renders crucial the roles of the intention of the impositor and the interpreter in communication. On this view, the meaning of an utterance cannot be determined by considering the sense of the words alone; rather, successful communication in everyday life and accurate interpretation of authoritative texts like the Scriptures requires a careful analysis of language according to principles of the terminist tradition of logic. Thus, Bacon’s conception of imposition attempts to account for changes in meaning in cases where the possibilities are infinite and yet follow certain patterns; Bacon’s theory is laid out in his DS within a system of different grades of equivocation.
Bacon treated of the problem of equivocation and univocation in the context of his theory of how words signify; within the same framework he also developed his theory of analogy as a mode of signification. He understood equivocation to be the case when a word designates many different objects; since there are different kinds of diversity between objects, it follows that there is also a plurality of cases of equivocation. For example, the word ‘dog’ can refer to the animal as well as the constellation (DS, §36, 93; CST, §130, 110). Corresponding to the different degrees of diversity or agreement (convenientia) existing on the level of the word’s meaning, there are different degrees of equivocation: Bacon distinguished between five such degrees in the DS, and six in the CST, which are represented here schematically (DS, §§37-46, 94-98; CST, §§131-139, 110-116).
Principal equivocation maximal diversity between significates like in regard to being and non-being
Equivocation in relational agreement absolute diversity of significates yet agreement in relation between significates like in regard to creator and creature
Equivocation of whole and parts partial diversity, partial agreement of significates like in whole and parts, universal and particulars
Equivocation of genus Lesser partial diversity of significates like in regard to equus (genus) and horse / donkey (species)
Minimal equivocation great identity of significates, diversity of mode of signification like in ‘loving’ designating as name and participle (amans)
Minimal equivocation no diversity of significates, no diversity of signs (grounded in grammatical interpretation) like in bishops (nominative plural) and bishop’s (genitive singular) (episcopi)
The six different kinds of equivocation are arranged hierarchically, in descending order of diversity and, correspondingly, equivocation: because the degree (that is, the mode of equivocation) depends upon the kind of difference of the significates, it follows that the smaller the diversity of the significates, the smaller the degree of equivocation. While the last two instances of diversity, strictly speaking, represent cases of grammatical ambiguity rather than equivocation, cases 2-5 represent cases of analogy, because analogy (analogia, comparatio, proportio) occurs “wherever there is diversity between the primary and secondary significates while there is still agreement, reference, and comparison;” and the modes of analogy are between pure univocation and pure equivocation (DS, §100, 115). It has been pointed out in recent literature that the original and remarkable feature of Bacon’s theory of analogy lay in the nature of the classification, namely that analogy is here subordinated under equivocation rather than being classified as equivalent with equivocation and univocation as was common during his time. According to Bacon, analogy, as an instance of equivocation, indicates the kind of comparison or relation that occurs in cases of equivocation, and what is emphasized within an analysis of equivocation is accordingly an inquiry into primary and secondary instances of meaning (De Libera, 1997, 120).
In order to account for the change of meaning of words in regard to primary or principal and secondary meaning, Bacon did not only point toward acts of imposition but also to the phenomenon of connotation (consignificatio) – also called ‘implied’ or ‘secondary meaning.’ Inspired by the Logic of the Arabic philosophers Avicenna and al Ghazali, Bacon offered an explanation of this semantic issue together with a systematic enumeration of the different kinds of connotation by connecting it to the concept of ‘natural sign’ in the sense of the first principal class of natural signs (S I.1). In this respect, Bacon’s theory of connotation was remarkable because during his time connotation was not being treated in a systematic way in relation to natural signs, and it has been pointed out in recent scholarship that the fact that Bacon accounted for connotation within a framework that combines the notions of imposition and reference into one unified theory of meaning was quite innovative. In short, to explain connotation, Bacon combined his accounts of conventional and natural meaning (signa ad placitum signa naturalia), in virtue of which he was able “to give a detailed semiotic theory of psycho-linguistic phenomena” (De Libera, 1997, 128; Pinborg, 1981, 409).
According to Bacon, connotation occurrs when the change of meaning of a word is not because of another act of tacit imposition but because the significates stand in a natural relation to other objects. It is possible, as Bacon stated, for one word to designate a plurality of objects based on one single act of imposition because the objects themselves have a relation to other things. In other words, a word signifies many objects not only because it is intended to do so in virtue of an act of soul, but, beyond imposition, because things have necessary connections to other things which is natural in the sense of the first subclass of natural signs (I.1). Thus, words are natural signs and the respective semiotic relation is based on inference, concomitance, or consequence. This way, Bacon continued, words signify an infinity of objects (DS, §§102-103, 116f.). He consequently distinguished eight modes in which consignification occurs, among which he mentioned the names of God implying creation and the names of creature implying God (modes two and three), or accidents implying substances, and universals implying some particulars (modes four and five) (DS, §§105-133, 117-125; see Pinborg, 1981).
In the CST, written approximately twenty-five years after the DS which represented Bacon’s semantics within a broad semiotic framework, Bacon returned to semantic issues, intending a “logical reform of speech” directed against errors in philosophy and theology (De Libera, 1997, 121). He tried to achieve this reform with semantic analyses directed against contemporary theories of reference. Within these he especially criticized two aspects: ontological doctrines revolving around the doctrine of “habitual being” and “empty classes” (for example, sentences like “Caesar is a human being,” with Caesar being dead) and linguistic doctrines revolving around the traditional concept of imposition. Like in the DS, his theory of imposition in CST reaffirmed the thesis of the arbitrariness of meaning and of the freedom of the speaker. With regard to the DS, the CST resumed earlier objections and arguments, adapted them to the respective new context, yet did not represent any “significant development beyond the theories espoused in the De Signis, with the exception of the double division of natural signs” (Maloney, 1983, 150).
Thus, in his CST Bacon again argued against appeals to notions such as habitual being (esse habituale) and confused as opposed to determinate being (esse confusum et determinatum), which were brought forward by some of his contemporaries (for example, Richard Rufus of Cornwall, d. c. 1260) in order to defend the possibility of the truth value of sentences involving the use of the name ‘Caesar’ or ‘Christ’ (CST, §§84-111, 86-99). According to Bacon, words signifying existing and non-existing entities represent cases of equivocation, yet a sentence could only be true when its terms signify an existing entity. “Hence we know that in every equivocation there is a difference of significates: in as many ways as there is difference, in so many modes can there be equivocation” (CST, §130, 111). In this gradation of kinds of equivocation, the sentence “John is dead,” uttered upon John’s death, represents the greatest kind of equivocation: a word signifying being and non-being at the same time in which case the sentence, according to Bacon, has no truth value: after death, the word ‘John’ signifies not John – a being thing – but a corpse – a non-being thing – and is therefore used equivocally (CST, §125, 104). Thus, Bacon acknowledged the immediate relevance of the problem of equivocation for theology: for example in the context of exegesis one had to ensure that the words used in a passage actually signify.

5. Languages

Bacon’s interest in language studies was not restricted to semantic or semiotic questions. In the context of his linguistic studies, he devoted himself to grammar also (1) insofar as it pertained and contributed to the reading and speaking of languages, especially the so-called ‘wisdom languages’ like Hebrew and Greek, and (2) insofar as it was supposed ultimately to contribute to an improvement of the methods and instruments of textual criticism. Bacon situated the science of wisdom languages among the ranks of those sciences he considered essential for the advancement of learning (and which also including such sciences as mathematics or the experimental sciences). Ignorance of these sciences, Bacon emphasized on many occasions, is to the detriment of learning and, since the status of learning was connected to the general well-being of Christendom, is to the detriment of Christendom as a whole. Thus, the goal of Bacon’s concern for languages was, as in the case of his later semiotic-semantic inquiries, situated within the wider context of his intended reform of learning, a reform aiming at the “Church and the Republic of the Faithful.”
The main texts in which Bacon developed his philological reflections are the third part of the Opus Maius (a section entitled On the Utility of Grammar, a part that was comprised of three subsections of which the DS was one), the Opus Tertium, and the Compendium Studii Philosophiae (CSP). He also wrote a Greek grammar (Oxford Greek Grammar, or OGG), the first of its kind in the west, and a work which he considered to be no more than an “introduction to the Greek language.”

a. Language Groups and Functions

In addition to his grammatical, lexicographical and philological reflections, he devoted much time to the practical justification for the learning of languages. At the time when Bacon began to study languages, sometime around 1267-1268, this topic was not established as a university discipline. In the third part of the Opus Maius, Bacon presented three different kinds of reasons for language study: (1) such as pertain to the scientific domain, (2) such as pertain both to the secular and divine domains, (3) such as pertain to functions of the Church and the relation of the Church to other peoples. For example, he emphasized a better and more accurate comprehension of the scientific literature, of which the major part was written in languages other than Latin. In regard to divine offices or to the giving of the sacraments, Bacon lamented the lack of the priests’ abilities to correctly pronounce Greek, Hebrew, or Chaldean words. But Bacon also tried to bring more mundane matters to the attention of his primary intended reader, Pope Clement IV, such as the negotiation of peace treaties or the demands of trade for which knowledge of foreign languages would be most beneficial. Another field for which Bacon considered the knowledge of languages useful was the peaceful conversion of infidels (OM, III, vol. 3, 80-125).
In his reflections on the types of language, Bacon distinguishes three groups: (1) the so-called wisdom languages, (2) Latin, and (3) the “languages of the laity.” He presented the wisdom languages in two different groupings: (i) the first of these groups consists of the languages of the Cross (Hebrew, Greek, and Latin) because they express “divine mysteries;” (ii) the second group is comprised of the languages of philosophy (Hebrew, Greek, and Arabic), and sometimes also Chaldean (today called Aramaic). The importance of learning those languages had to do with the origins and passing on of wisdom; Bacon believed that all wisdom came from God who revealed it to faithful and infidel alike. Since God revealed his wisdom first in Hebrew, which was then renewed first in Greek (by Aristotle) and then in Arabic (most notably by Avicenna), scholars should have mastery of these languages in order to succeed in their scientific pursuits. In a similar vein, Bacon held Latin in much lower esteem: nothing original had been written in Latin, it was merely a repository of foreign learning. Opposed to the Latin of the clergy, Bacon also considered the so-called “vulgar-languages” or “languages of the laity,” which comprised a third group of languages. These languages, although inferior and not appropriate for scientific purposes because of the poverty of their vocabulary, were the ones that Bacon regarded as optimally suited for preaching (Rosier-Catach, 1997, 81-83).

b. Bacon’s Formulation of the Universal Principle of Grammar

Within the field of philology, Bacon also studied the relations between different languages and the structure of individual languages, and within this context he gave the famous formulation of the principle of universal grammar. Bacon stated that there are families of related languages like (1) Greek, (2) the Gallican language family, (3) the Slavic language family, and (4) Latin. Greek diversified itself into its different idioms Attic, Aeolian, Doric, and Ionian, while all these languages were substantially one. Bacon regarded Latin, on the other hand, as derived from Greek in both grammar and spoken language. Bacon held that the substance of a language guarantees the unity of a language and its identity in time, beyond accidental differences due to the different places at which the language is spoken and in spite of phonetic or semantic variations (CSP, vi-vii, 432-464). His comparatist analyses lead him even so far as to state that as there was something substantially identical in the various spoken languages, so there was something identical in the different grammars. In regard to this “linguistic ‘substance’” (Rosier-Catach, 1997, 86), Bacon suggested that it revealed itself in universal features common to all languages: “In its substance, grammar is one and the same in all languages, even if it accidentally varies” (OGG, 27). Accidental diversity, on the other hand, is another fundamental feature of language, according to Bacon, and it is due to the fact that language is conventional (ad placitum) and that every nation chose its own linguistic means: “In every language, words are given at pleasure, and this is why the Greeks imposed words according to their own will as we did according to our [will] and in accordance with the principles of our language as they in accordance with the principles of their language” (OGG, 164).

c. Philology within Bacon’s Program for the Reform of Learning

Bacon further connected his comparatist analyses to the reform of learning: the fact that, as Bacon noted further, each idiom has its own distinctive characteristics such as vocabulary, rhythmic and musical features, makes literal translations impossible. Therefore, translators like Michael Scot and Gerard of Cremona who, according to Bacon, in this sense were not absolutely proficient in the languages they translated from, corrupted important texts like Aristotle’s works as well as the Paris Vulgate (OT, ch. xxv, 91). Hence, what is needed are translators who were proficient enough in both scientific and linguistic skills – knowing the diversities of languages, their relationships, and the origins of words – to provide scholars with translations that meet scientific and linguistic standards. Thus, etymology was another important element in a diachronic analysis of languages, and Bacon sought to help his contemporaries, for example in regard to the pronunciation of foreign words, by providing them with lists of Hebrew and Greek words which had become Latin words (OGG, 133ff.).

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

Below is a list of Bacon’s major works on logic and language in chronological order with English translations of the titles.

i. 1240’s-1250’s

  • Bacon, R. 1940. Summa Grammatica, ed. Robert Steele. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Summary of Grammar.
  • Bacon, R. 1986. Summulae dialectices. I: De termino. II: De enuntiatione. In Alain de Libera, ed., Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen-Âge 53, 139-289.
    • Summary of Dialectics I-II.
  • Bacon, R. 1987. Summulae dialectices. III: De argumentatione. In Alain de Libera, ed., Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen-Âge 54, 171-278.
    • Summary of Dialectics III.
  • Bacon, R. 2009. The Art and Science of Logic, translation, notes and introduction by Thomas S. Maloney. Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Mediaeval Studies.English translation of the Summulae Dialectices.

ii. 1250’s-1268: Papal Opera

  • Fredborg, K. M., Lauge Nielsen, and Jan Pinborg (Eds.). 1978. An unedited part of Roger Bacon’s ‘Opus Maius: De Signis’. Traditio 34, 75-136.
  • On Signs, fragment of Opus Maius, part three.

iii. 1268-1292

  • Bacon, R. 1902. Grammatica Graeca and Grammatica Hebraica (The Greek Grammar of Roger Bacon and a Fragment of His Hebrew Grammar), ed. Edmund Nolan and S. A. Hirsch. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • The exact dating of the two grammars is not determined.
  • Bacon, R. 1988. Compendium Studii Theologiae, edition and translation with introduction and notes by Thomas S. Maloney (Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters, 20). Leiden: Brill.
    • Summary of the Study of Theology.

b. Secondary Sources

Excellent overviews on the principal themes, arguments and authors are provided in:

i. General Studies on Medieval Theories of Language

  • Ashworth, E. J. 2003. Language and logic. In A. S. McGrade, ed., Cambridge Companion to Medieval Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 73-96.
    • Brief overview on the principal themes in medieval theories of language and logic.
  • Bursill-Hall, Geoffrey, Sten Ebbesen and E. F. K. Koerner. (Eds.). 1990. De Ortu Grammaticae: Studies in Medieval Grammar and Linguistic Theory in Memory of Jan Pinborg. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing Company.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, Anthony Kenny and Jan Pinborg. (Eds.). 1982. The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Contains overview articles on “The old logic,” “Logic in the high middle ages: Semantic theory,” and “Logic in the high middle ages: Propositions and modalities.”
  • Pasnau, Robert and Christina Van Dyke. (Eds.). 2010. The Cambridge History of Medieval PhilosophyVolume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1994. La Parole Comme Acte: Sur la Grammaire Et La Sémantique au XIIIe Siècle. Paris: Vrin.
    • Focuses on the ‘intentionalist’ current in grammar, special attention to Roger Bacon.

ii. On Roger Bacon’s Philosophy of Language

  • Bourgain, P. 1989. Les sens de la langue chez Roger Bacon. In Traduction et traducteurs au Moyen Age. Paris: Editions du CNRS, 317-331.
  • De Libera, Alain. 1981. Roger Bacon et le probleme de l’appellatio univoca. In H. A. G. Braakhuis, C. H. Kneepkens and L. M. de Rijk, eds., English Logic and Semantics: From the End of the Twelfth Century to the Time of Ockham and Burleigh. Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, 193-234.
  • De Libera, Alain. 1990. De la logique à la grammaire: Remarques sur la théorie de la determination chez Roger Bacon et Lambert d’Auxerre (Lambert de Lagny). In G. Bursill-Hall, S. Ebbesen and K. Koerner, eds., De grammatica: A Tribute to Jan Pinborg. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing Company, 209-226.
  • De Libera, Alain. 1991. Roger Bacon et la reference vide. Sur quelques antecedents médiévaux du paradoxe de Meinong. In J. Jolivet, Z. Kaluza and A. De Libera, eds., Lectionem Varietates: Homages á Paul Vignaux. Paris: Vrin, 85-120.
  • De Libera, Alain. 1997. Roger Bacon et la logique. In Jeremiah Hackett, ed., Roger Bacon and the Sciences: Commemorative Essays. Leiden: Brill, 103-132.
  • Fredborg, Karin Margareta. 1981. Roger Bacon on ‘Impositio vocis ad significandum’. In H. A. G. Braakhuis, C. H. Kneepkens and L. M. de Rijk, eds., English Logic and Semantics: From the End of the Twelfth Century to the Time of Ockham and Burleigh. Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, 167-191.
  • Hovdhaugen, Even. 1990. Una et eadem: Some observations on Roger Bacon’s Greek grammar. In Geoffrey L. Bursill-Hall, Sten Ebbesen and E. F. K. Koerner, eds., De ortu Grammaticae: Studies in Medieval Grammar and Linguistic Theory in memory of Jan Pinborg. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing Company, 117-131.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1983a. Roger Bacon on the significatum of words. In Lucie Brind’Amour and Eugene Vance, eds., Archéologie du Signe (Papers in Medieval Studies, 3). Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies, 187-211.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1983b. The semiotics of Roger Bacon. Medieval Studies 45, 120-154.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1984. Roger Bacon on equivocation. Vivarium 22, 85-112.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1985. The extreme realism of Roger Bacon. Review of Metaphysics 38, 807-837.
  • Maloney, Thomas S. 1995. Is the De doctrina christiana the source for Bacon’s semiotics? In Edward D. English, ed., Reading and Wisdom: The De Doctrina Christiana of Augustine in the Middle Ages. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 126-42.
  • Perler, Dominik. 2005. Logik – eine ‘wertlose Wissenschaft?’ Zum Verhältnis von Logik und Theologie. In Dominik Perler and Ulrich Rudolph, eds., Logik und Theologie: Das Organon im Arabischen und im Lateinischen Mittelalter. Leiden: Brill, 375-399.
  • Pinborg, Jan. 1981. Roger Bacon on Signs: A newly recovered part of the Opus Maius. In Herausgegeben Von Jan P. Beckmann, Ludger Honnefelder, Gabriel Jussen, Barbara Munxelhaus, Gangolf Schrimpf, and Georg Wieland Unter Leitung Von Wolfgang Kluxen, eds., Sprache und Erkenntnis im Mittelalter: Volume 1. New York: Walter de Gruyter, 403-412.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1984. Grammaire, loqique, sémantique, deux positions opposées au XIIIe siècle: Roger Bacon et les modistes. Histoire Epistémologie Langage 6, 21-34.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1994. La Parole Comme Acte: Sur la Grammaire Et la Sémantique au XIIIe Siècle. Paris: Vrin.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1997. Roger Bacon and grammar. In Jeremiah Hackett, ed., Roger Bacon and the Sciences: Commemorative Essays. Leiden: Brill, 67-102.
  • Rosier, Irène. 1998. Roger Bacon, al-Farabi, et Augustin. Rhétorique, logique et philosophie morale. In Gilbert Dahan and Irène Rosier-Catach, eds., La rhétorique d’Aristote: traditions et commentaires, de l’Antiquité au XVIIe Siècle. Paris: Vrin, 87–110.
  • Rosier, Irène and De Libera, Alain. 1986. Intention de signifier et engendrement du discours chez Roger Bacon. Histoire, Epistémologie, Langage 8, 63-79.

Author Information

Pia Antolic-Piper
James Madison University
U. S. A.

Pluralist Theories of Truth

Truth pluralism (or ‘alethic’ pluralism) is a view about the nature of truth. Broadly speaking, the thought behind the view is that truth may require different treatments for different kinds of subject matter. In particular, there is the prospect for it to be consistent to conceive of truth in a realist manner for discourse about the material world, while maintaining an anti-realist notion of truth for discourse about subjects that are perhaps more mind-dependent in character, such as discourse about ethics or comedy. Contemporary pluralist theories of truth have their roots in William James’s pragmatism. The literature on truth pluralism is expanding rapidly; new avenues of research on the subject are constantly being explored. This article introduces the central motivations, frameworks, and problems for the view which have preoccupied much of the discussion to date in contemporary analytic philosophy. Part 1 gives a brief history of some of the main inspirations behind the views outlined in contemporary debates. Part 2 goes through some preliminary issues. Part 3 outlines one of the main motivations for truth pluralism. Part 4 details the main formulations of the view that have been offered, and discusses the problems each formulation faces. Finally, Part 5 discusses some concerns about the general approach of the view.

Table of Contents

  1. A Brief History of Truth Pluralism
  2. Truth Pluralism Preliminaries
  3. Motivations for Truth Pluralism
  4. Forms of Truth Pluralism
    1. Simple Alethic Pluralism
      1. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 1)
      2. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 1)
      3. Norm of Inquiry
      4. Generalizations
    2. One Concept Many Properties
      1. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 2)
      2. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 2)
      3. Norm of Inquiry
      4. Generalizations
    3. Second-Order Functionalism
    4. Manifestation Functionalism
    5. Disjunctivism and Simple Determination Pluralism
  5. General Issues
    1. The Problem of Domain Individuation
    2. The Demandingness Objection
    3. Problems with Platitudes
    4. The Deflationary Challenge
  6. References and Further Reading

1. A Brief History of Truth Pluralism

The majority of this article is focused on a contemporary debate in analytical philosophy, but, of course, debates about the nature of truth are long-established in the history of philosophy, and in a variety of philosophical traditions. Some of the more prominent theories are correspondence theories, coherence theories, pragmatist theories, identity theories, and deflationary theories, and there are of course a number of different varieties of each of these views (for more information on these theories, see the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy article on Truth).

Contemporary pluralist theories of truth have their roots in William James’s pragmatism (though he himself disliked the name), which is outlined most prominently in his collection of lectures entitled Pragmatism, first published in 1907. James himself took true beliefs to be those beliefs that served some useful purpose, but recognised that there are many different ways that beliefs can be useful, often depending on the kinds of things the beliefs were about, with observational beliefs, moral beliefs, and mathematical beliefs, being just a few examples. Moreover, James noted that what made these different kinds of beliefs useful might vary from case to case. For instance, for observational beliefs we might think that their utility is established by their being verified, for mathematical beliefs by being capable of being proved, and for moral beliefs by cohering with other moral beliefs we have. Thus, although James held the general pragmatist thesis that for a belief to be true is for it to be useful:

Our account of truth is an account of truths in the plural…having only this quality in common: that they pay. (James 1975: 104)

He also held that there were various different ways in which beliefs could be useful:

To copy a reality is, indeed, one way of agreeing with it, but it is by no means essential. (James 1975: 102)

The spirit of James’s approach was built on in the mid-20th Century by Michael Dummett, who, in his famous 1959 essay ‘Truth’, very much echoed James when he wrote:

The question is not whether [“true” and “false”] are in practice applied to ethical statements, but whether, if they are so applied, the point of doing so would be the same as the point of applying them to statements of other kinds, and, if not, in what ways it would be different. (Dummett 1978: 3)

Perhaps the first explicit statement of the kind of pluralism found in contemporary debates is given by Alan White in his 1957 essay, “Truth as Appraisal”. Like James, White held that there is some unity to the use of the word true, but he instead holds that this unity is supplied by the term’s use as a term of appraisal, as a way to commend a particular statement. White held a ‘dual-aspect’ theory of truth, which held that this appraisal-aspect is combined with a descriptive aspect, which states the criteria for establishing when the term ‘true’ is used correctly. White then argued that these criteria vary according to the subject matter of the statement, holding that different ‘theories’ of truth, such as correspondence theory and coherence theory are apt to give the criteria for the correct use of ‘true’ in different cases.

With the rise of deflationary theories of truth in the mid to late 20th Century, James and White’s observations received perhaps less attention than they deserved. The general project of truth pluralism was revitalized, however, by the publication of Crispin Wright’s 1992 book Truth and Objectivity, which aimed to place a broadly pluralist account of truth at the heart of a new method of understanding debates about realism and anti-realism. Wright’s book had significant influence in a number of different areas of philosophy, and provoked considerable debate. In the 21st Century, Michael P. Lynch, along with Crispin Wright, has further developed the project of truth pluralism, and his 2009 book Truth as One and Many is the most comprehensive single study of truth pluralism and its potential implications to date. As we will see below, there are many different ways to understand the exact specification of truth pluralism, but before we approach these it will be useful to try to get to the heart of what drives each of these views, and to clarify some of the terminology commonly used.

2. Truth Pluralism Preliminaries

The basic idea behind all forms of truth pluralism is that the analysis of truth may require different treatment for different kinds of subject matter. This idea is normally spelled out using the notion of a domain of discourse (or region of thought). This is a formalization of the idea that human thought and discourse can be about a large number of different subjects. For instance, we may debate about whether a particular joke is funny, whether an action is morally wrong, whether the earth goes around the sun, or whether there is a largest prime number. The thought is that these debates concern very different things, and this needs to be taken into account when we come to analyse the claims made in them.

The truth pluralist draws upon these intuitive distinctions when it comes to the matter of investigating the nature of truth. As we will see below, truth pluralists have reason to think that there are important things to be said about the nature of truth, but typically – at least at some stage of the theory – hold that the question of what needs to be said is addressed on a domain-by-domain basis. That is, they are unhappy with the thought that we can give an account of the nature of truth without taking into account the subject-matter of the claims of which truth is predicated. A full account of the nature of truth, on the pluralist view, will need to look at truth in a specific domain, as opposed to (or as well as) what constitutes truth per se.

Before moving on to the motivations for truth pluralism, and the various forms of the view, it is worth briefly pausing to note some distinctions which are important in the truth pluralism literature. These distinctions are between the truth predicate, the truth concept, and the truth property. The truth predicate, typically taking the form ‘is true’ is the linguistic entity appended to certain sentences, as in “‘snow is white” is true’. One who competently uses the words 'true' and 'truth' can be said to possess the concept of truth, and an analysis of the concept of truth will aim to uncover what those conditions of competent use consist in. The property of truth is what is ascribed by the truth predicate.

To get clearer on these distinctions, consider the following analogy with water (this analogy is originally due to Alston (1996), and is also emphasised by Wright (2001) and Lynch (2009)). We have the predicate ‘is water’, which we use to say of a certain substance that it is water (for example, ‘the liquid in the bottle is water’). We also have the concept of water, that any competent user of the term ‘water’ understands (for example, that water is a clear, colourless, tasteless liquid, that it comes out of taps, and runs through rivers and streams). We also have the property of being water, which is what the stuff that corresponds to the concept, and is referred to by the predicate, consists in. Scientific discoveries have deemed the property of water to be identical to the property of being H2O, and this tells us what the nature of water is. In the water case, then, the system works as follows. We have the water predicate, which is used to ascribe a particular property – being water – to particular substances. Competent users of the water predicate will be said to possess the concept of water, and this concept demarcates a kind of worldly substance. The property of water captures the essence of this worldly substance (H­2O). Note also that it is not a condition on competent users of the concept that they be aware of the nature of the property (as indeed was not the case before the discovery of water as H2O): possessing the concept does not necessarily require possessing knowledge of the essence of the property.

Most of the investigations into the nature of truth concern the essence of the truth property. However, as we will see, in the story of truth pluralism, the concept of truth has an important role to play. (For more on the concept/property distinction in this context, and how the nature of the truth property may not be transparent from the truth concept, see Alston 2002.)

It is also worth saying a little about truth-bearers before we progress. There are a number of different things that philosophers have taken to be the bearers of truth, with beliefs, statements, sentences, utterances of sentences, and propositions to be perhaps the most prominent examples. One form of truth pluralism would perhaps be a view which held that all of these potential bearers are genuine truth-bearers, and that there are different kinds of truth appropriate to each bearer. This would be an interesting kind of truth pluralism, though it is not a view which seems to necessarily share the same motivations as the views discussed here. For the purposes of this article, we will follow the majority of truth pluralists in holding that it is propositions that are the primary bearers of truth, and when we speak of sentences, utterances, or beliefs as being true it is in the sense that they express a proposition that is true.

3. Motivations for Truth Pluralism

Correspondence theories of truth may appear to be intuitively attractive: they promise to make truth a matter of a relation between linguistic or mental entities and the separate objects and properties that they purport to represent. However, subscribing to such a view about truth for a particular domain of discourse carries with it significant metaphysical commitments: in other words, it can be thought of as implying that there are mind-independent facts of the matter which our statements, thoughts or beliefs map onto. This has posed particular problems about employing the notion of truth in the moral domain, for example, where the idea of there being mind-independent facts of the matter causes a degree of uneasiness (see, for example, Mackie 1977). It also causes problems in the mathematical domain, where we might be more comfortable thinking that there are mind-independent facts of the matter, but, due to the abstract nature of the facts involved, the notion of ‘mapping onto’ these facts seems misguided. Thoughts along these lines have been expressed by Lynch (2009) as what he calls the ‘Scope Problem’, which suggests that each existing ‘robust’ theory of truth (such as correspondence and coherence theories) is limited to accounting only for the truth of claims of a certain type. (See Dodd 2012 and Edwards 2011b for further discussion of the strength of the Scope Problem.)

It is tempting to respond to this uneasiness by denying that truth is applicable in these problematic domains, and adopting ‘expressivist’ or ‘fictionalist’ views of the subject matter instead, for example. However, pulling in the opposite direction is the attractive view of minimal truth-aptness. This is the thought that a domain of discourse can sustain a notion of truth in virtue of meeting very basic standards of syntactic discipline (see, for example, Boghossian 1990, Wright 1992), allowing them to express propositions which are, in turn, apt for truth. The basic idea is that a domain will qualify as being syntactically disciplined if its component sentences can be used as the antecedents of conditionals, be negated, and feature as the targets of propositional attitude statements. In addition to these features, if a domain is syntactically disciplined then there is a distinction between seeming to be right and being right, along with the intelligibility of speakers saying ‘I used to think that p but now I realize I was mistaken’. Moral discourse, for example, plausibly meets these standards. We often say things like ‘I used to think that eating meat was morally wrong, but now I realize I was mistaken’, or ‘I wonder whether abortion is morally wrong’. We can also note that moral sentences, such as ‘murder is wrong’, can feature as the antecedents of conditionals, such as ‘if murder is wrong, then those that murder will be punished’, or be negated, as in ‘it is not the case that murder is right’, which – on the terms of the view - are further hallmarks of sentences which express truth-apt propositions. Consequently, it is not so clear that we can give up on truth in these domains. But that seems to lead us back into an implausible realism, and herein lies the problem.

However, one may well point out that this is not such a problem, as there is already a plausible, and popular, theory of truth which explains how these kinds of claims are truth-apt, and without any unwanted metaphysical baggage: so-called ‘deflationary’ theories of truth (see, for example, Horwich 1998, Field 1994, and Stoljar and Damnjanovic 2010 for an overview of deflationary theories). The deflationist insists that the truth predicate exists just to perform certain logical functions, such as the endorsement of a proposition, or generalisation over a potentially infinite number of propositions. Deflationary theories of truth thus typically focus on the use of the truth predicate, and the possession of the truth concept, as opposed to the truth property. (See Devitt 2001 for a good discussion of the project undertaken by deflationists.) Deflationism though may be able to give us the resources to explain how all of the classes of sentences we are considering can be true, but it does so at the cost of being unable to use truth as an explanatory resource when attempting to understand other concepts, and requires revision to some of our basic thoughts that connect truth to other concepts of philosophical interest (for discussion see, for example, Lynch 2004a, Davidson 1999, Field 1986). There are also concerns that deflationism is an internally unstable view, outlined in Wright’s (1992) ‘inflationary argument’ (for further discussion see Horwich 1996 and 1998, Rumfitt 1995, van Cleve 1996, Kölbel 1997 and Miller 2001). I will not go into these problems in depth here, but suffice to say that deflationism does not offer a problem-free solution to the problem under discussion.

The truth pluralist agrees with the deflationist that all of the domains we have considered contain sentences that are capable of expressing true propositions. However, the truth pluralist does not think, like the deflationist, that this is the end of the matter. There is a story to tell about the nature of truth, the pluralist thinks, but this story will not always be the same. According to the truth pluralist, there will be a property in virtue of which the propositions expressed by sentences in a particular domain of discourse will be true, but this property will change depending on the domain we are considering. In other words, although the notion of truth as correspondence to the facts might fit our domain of discourse about the material world, a different notion of truth - perhaps one with less metaphysical baggage, constructed out of coherence, or justification or warrant (for example Wright’s notion of ‘superassertibility’ – see Wright 1992) - may fit the domains in which the correspondence notion looks problematic. Consequently, truth pluralism offers a treatment of truth which allows for a wide range of beliefs, sentences and the like to be true, although holding onto the idea that there are interesting things to say about truth.

There are thus initially two constraints on all truth pluralist theories. They must:

(1) Adequately explain how truth is to be analysed differently in different domains of discourse, and

(2) Ensure that truth is held to be robust enough to avoid the criticisms of deflationism.

With these motivations in mind, we will now examine some of the specific formulations of the view. Note that the versions I will be looking at will be those that hold that there are roles for different types of properties, such as correspondence and coherence, to play in the different accounts of truth in different domains, but there are also views of a pluralist persuasion which hold that truth is always correspondence, with there being different kinds of correspondence (for example Horgan 2001, Sher 2004).

4. Forms of Truth Pluralism

a. Simple Alethic Pluralism

The first option is a view which Lynch calls ‘Simple Alethic Pluralism’ (SAP) (Lynch does not hold the view, and it is unclear whether anyone ever has – though some attribute the view to Wright’s (1992) formulation of truth pluralism, which speaks of a plurality of truth predicates. Wright has since clarified his position – see below). Recalling the differences between concept and property noted above, this view holds that there are different concepts of truth in different domains of discourse. That is, that the concept of truth in discourse about the material world is identified with the concept of corresponding to fact, and the concept of truth in arithmetic is identified with the concept of coherence. Associated with each of these concepts will be their corresponding predicates and properties, so, if the concept of truth changes from domain to domain, the content of the truth predicate and the nature of the truth property will also change from domain to domain. On this view, then, there are different concepts, predicates and properties associated with the word ‘true’ in different domains of discourse.

Returning to the two dimensions of meaning that we discussed earlier, SAP holds that the meaning of ‘true’ varies from domain to domain at both the level of concept and property. It varies at the level of concept as different concepts are associated with ‘true’ in different domains, and it varies at the level of property as different properties are associated with the different concepts in different domains. One implication of this view, then, is that – at least on the two dimensions of meaning discussed – there is no domain-invariant meaning of ‘true’: the meaning of the predicate always depends on the subject-matter to which it is attributed, and is thus multiply ambiguous.

We will now turn to discuss the main problems for the SAP formulation of truth pluralism.

i. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 1)

On the SAP view, truth (both as predicate and property) is tied to specific domains of discourse. However, as Tappolet (1997) pointed out, our reasoning frequently mixes statements from different domains. Consider the following example:

(1) This cat is wet

(2) This cat is funny

Therefore, this cat is wet and funny

Validity of arguments is traditionally understood as necessary preservation of truth, but how could we understand the validity of this argument on the SAP view? To make the point explicit, let us use the truth predicates from different domains:

(1*) ‘This cat is wet’ is truem

(2*) ‘This cat is funny’ is truec

Therefore, ‘this cat is wet and funny’ is true?

Disregarding for the moment the issue of what truth predicate applies to the conclusion (see the problem of mixed compounds below), this reformulation of the argument is invalid as different truth predicates are applied to each premise and conclusion, thus rendering the argument guilty of the fallacy of equivocation. Appeal to properties will not help either, as different truth properties correspond to each different truth predicate, thus ensuring that no single property is preserved across the inference (see below and Pedersen 2006 for detailed further discussion of the different aspects of this problem).

ii. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 1)

Now consider compound claims, like conjunctions or disjunctions. Tappolet (2000) observes that we often make compounds of claims from different domains of discourse, such as the already mentioned ‘this cat is wet and funny’. (Williamson 1994 makes a similar point.) We have already noted that there is some puzzlement over what truth predicate could apply to this conjunction, but, more worryingly, Tappolet states, is that there is a basic statement about conjunctions, namely that a conjunction is true iff its conjuncts are true. If different truth predicates apply to the conjunction and to the conjuncts, then principles like this look under threat, once more from concerns about equivocation. These principles seem to require a general truth predicate, but SAP can provide none.

iii. Norm of Inquiry

One of the main motivations for moving beyond deflationism is to accommodate the thought that truth constitutes a norm of inquiry. It seems on the face of it as though SAP can accommodate this thought as there are different truth properties in different domains of discourse. However, Lynch (2006) argues that we need to read this constraint as the need for truth to constitute a single general norm of inquiry. All SAP would give us is lots of different norms (truth-in-ethics, truth-in-mathematics, and so forth) which would provide different norms for different domains of discourse, as opposed to a single general norm that all assertions (regardless of domain) aim at. If Lynch’s argument is correct, then, SAP has trouble accommodating the normative dimension of truth.

iv. Generalizations

One common use of the truth predicate is to make general claims, such as ‘Everything Socrates said is true’. This effectively allows us to endorse everything Socrates said without having to re-assert everything he did say. But how could we understand this usage on the SAP view? In particular, what truth predicate appears in the statement? For instance, suppose that Socrates remarks on a wide variety of subjects, from the weather to what is morally good to the axioms of set theory. All of these claims would seemingly be subject to different truth predicates, so how is a general claim like ‘Everything Socrates said is true’ even expressible without the aid of a general truth predicate?

b. The One Concept Many Properties View (OCMP)

The second option, due to Crispin Wright (1992, 2001, 2003), holds that there is a single concept of truth, held fixed across domains, and different truth properties which satisfy this concept in different domains. This view aims to hold one aspect of the meaning of the predicate ‘true’ fixed across domains – namely the concept associated with ‘true’ – although accommodating diversity of content by holding that there are different properties of truth in different domains, identified by their ability to (locally) satisfy the truth concept.

On this view, the content of the concept of truth is specified by a list of ‘platitudes’ about truth, which are taken to be truths about truth, knowable a priori, which specify the features that truth is taken to necessarily have, often by reference to connections between truth and other closely related concepts. Some candidate platitudes are as follows:

Transparency. That to assert a proposition is to present it as true and, more generally, that any attitude to a proposition is an attitude to its truth – that to believe, doubt, or fear, for example, that p is to believe, doubt, or fear that p is true.

(E). <p> is true iff p. (Note: ‘<p>’ here and below stands for ‘the proposition that p’, following Horwich’s (1998) notation.)

Embedding. A proposition’s aptitude for truth is preserved under a variety of operations - in particular, truth-apt propositions have negations, conjunctions, disjunctions, and so forth, which are likewise truth-apt.

Straight-talking. A true proposition ‘tells it like it is’, in some way.

Contrast. A proposition may be true but not justified, or justified but not true.

Stability. If a proposition is ever true, then it always is, so that whatever may, at any particular time, be truly asserted may - perhaps by appropriate transformations of mood, or tense - be truly asserted at any time.

Absoluteness. Truth is absolute - there is, strictly, no such thing as a proposition’s being more or less true; propositions are completely true if true at all.

The basic idea is that a complete list of truth platitudes will characterise the concept of truth exhaustively. This concept will be associated with the truth predicate in all of its relevant uses, regardless of the subject-matter of which it is attributed. One dimension of the meaning of ‘true’ is thus held fixed: the concept of truth with which the predicate is associated.

The aspect of meaning of ‘true’ which varies on this view is the property associated with ‘true’. What this property is will vary from one domain to the next. For example, the truth property for the empirical domain might well be correspondence, and the truth property for the mathematical domain might be coherence. Thus, at the level of property, there is variation in the nature of truth, but not variation at the level of concept.

According to Wright, a property’s ability to be considered a truth property is dependent on its ability to satisfy the following procedure. First of all, occurrences of the term ‘true’ are replaced with the name of the candidate property (so, for example, in the case of correspondence, the Contrast platitude would become “A proposition may correspond to the facts but not be justified, and vice versa”). If truth is preserved by these reformulations (that is, if all the platitudes remain true when rewritten), then, according to Wright, the property in question has the pedigree to be considered a truth property.

The method here can be compared with the methods employed by functionalists in the philosophy of mind (for example, Lewis 1972, Kim 1998) in that properties such as correspondence realize the role set out by the truth platitudes, as, for instance, c-fibers firing realize the role set out by our folk concept of pain. However, it is contentious whether Wright’s view should be understood along those lines (Lynch 2006, 2009, for example, interprets OCMP in this way, but Wright (2011) resists this interpretation).

OCMP gives us a single truth predicate, but not a single truth property. How might this help it avoid the problems posed for SAP? Not much, on first glance, but, as I will note, there has been more effort to defend OCMP than SAP on these fronts.

i. The Problem of Mixed Inferences (Form 2)

As we have a single truth predicate, the meaning of which is fixed by a single truth concept, the charge of equivocation when it comes to mixed inferences may be circumvented. However, there is still the more pressing issue of truth preservation to address. Remember that we noted that it is widely held that validity is necessary preservation of truth across an inference. This way of putting it sounds distinctly like there is a single property (truth) preserved from premises to conclusion. However, note that there is no single property of truth on the OCMP view, so different truth properties will be possessed by premises from different domains of discourse. The problem now kicks in at the level of properties: how to explain preservation of truth across mixed inferences when there is no single truth property.

Responses to this form of the problem have been offered by Beall (2000), who argues that the pluralist should adopt a conception of validity favoured by many-valued logics, and Pedersen (2006) who explores the possibility of using plural quantification. Cotnoir (2012) offers an algebraic account of how an OCMP pluralist can account for the validity of mixed inferences.

ii. The Problem of Mixed Compounds (Form 2)

The initial statement of the problem only seems to affect SAP, as it is a challenge to understand the phrase ‘a conjunction is true iff its conjuncts are true’ in the absence of a general truth predicate. As SAP is the only view which lacks a single truth predicate, it only seems to affect this view and not the others: all the other views can hold that it is the same predicate in both uses. However, there is a deeper challenge which is not averted by this response. That is to explain in what way the conjunction is true, and this can kick in just as well at the level of properties. On the OCMP view, the challenge will be to explain what truth property the mixed conjunction has. On the other views, it will be a challenge to explain which lower level property the mixed conjunction has which explains why it has the general truth property.

One route to explore is to observe that the truth of a compound is, in some sense, supervenient on its components, and to try to construct a truth (or lower level) property out of this idea. This option is explored by Edwards (2008, 2009), who, defending the OCMP view, suggests that we can understand the truth property for compounds as being the property of satisfying the rules for compounds laid out by the preferred system of logic. This option could also be extended to the other views (bar SAP) which could hold that this is the relevant lower level property for compounds that explains why they have the general truth property. This option is discussed by Cotnoir (2009), and rejected by Lynch (2009), who prefers to think of the truth of compounds as instances of truth “self-manifesting”, as a consequence of its being grounded in the truth of the components. See Lynch 2009 Chapter 5 for further discussion of this idea.

iii. Norm of Inquiry

The norm of inquiry problem seems to hold in its original form (indeed, it was originally pressed by Lynch against the OCMP view). Again, there is no general property possessed by all truths, but, if truth is to be considered a general norm of inquiry, then there needs to be a general truth property capable of grounding this norm. Insofar as OCMP cannot allow for this, it falls prey to the objection.

iv. Generalizations

The matter of generalizations is again subtle. Equipped with a general truth predicate the puzzlement over what predicate appears in the sentence ‘Everything Socrates said is true’ disappears. But, again, one may think that the problem kicks in at the level of properties. We could read the sentence as attributing a property to all the things Socrates said – the property of truth. But, we cannot take this statement at face-value on the OCMP view, as, in this case, there is no general truth property that is possessed by all the things Socrates said.

However, OCMP may have a response to this problem which draws on the solution to the problem of mixed conjunctions. If OCMP interprets ‘everything Socrates said is true’ as a long conjunction of all the things Socrates said, then perhaps it can analyze that conjunction in much the same way as the mixed conjunction discussed above. Alternatively, as Wright 2012 explores, OCMP may prefer to instead say that the same style of solution may be adopted for generalizations themselves. That is, a generalization is true just in case all of the propositions that fall under the scope of that generalization are themselves true in their appropriate ways.

The remaining views which we will discuss all allow for a general truth property, as well as a general truth predicate. As a result they seem, on the face of it, to avoid the problem of mixed inferences, norm of inquiry, generalization and mixed compounds problems, and, as a result, I will not discuss each problem in turn for each view. However, as we will see below, the norm of inquiry problem still has relevance in some cases. Also, as hinted above, there are issues over whether the mixed compounds problem will still affect these views, which are explored further in Lynch 2009 and Edwards 2008.

c. Second-Order Functionalism (SOF)

Lynch (2001a, 2004, 2006) proposes to think of truth as a functional concept. A functional concept describes the role that anything that falls under the concept must play, but it is intended to stay reasonably neutral on the issue of what it is that realizes that role. This idea originated in the philosophy of mind by way of giving a method of systematizing particular causal roles of particular mental phenomena, but Lynch extends the idea to systematize the non-causal, perhaps normative, role of truth in our cognitive lives. Lynch’s method of constructing the functional role of the concept of truth begins, like Wright’s, with the collection of a number of platitudes about truth, which locate truth on the conceptual map, linking it with the related concepts of fact, proposition and belief. Lynch’s platitudes are:

The proposition that p is true if and only if p.

The proposition that p is false if and only if it is not the case that p.

Propositions are the bearers of truth and falsity.

Every proposition has a negation.

A proposition can be justified but not true, and true but not justified. (Lynch 2001a: 730)

These platitudes form a structure which will provide a complete account of the role truth is taken to play. This structure takes the form of a ‘network analysis’ (the term is due to Smith 1994). That is, once we have our full list of platitudes, we first rewrite them slightly, replacing simple instances of ‘is true’ with ‘has the property of being true’, so that, instead of, say ‘The proposition that p is true if and only if p.’, we have ‘The proposition that p has the property of being true if and only if p.’ We then make a conjunction of all the platitudes we have collected, and replace all of the alethic concepts in the platitudes with variables. What we end up with is a condition which is billed to give us the exact specification of the ‘job description’ for truth, its ‘functional role’. (For more on this process see Lynch 2001a, and also Smith 1994 and Jackson 1998.)

This process yields a functional definition of truth, as it gives us the precise features that a property must have if it is to be regarded as realizing the truth role: it must be related to a number of other properties in the required way. As noted before, these features may be exhibited by different properties in different domains of discourse, and SOF allows for this, as, provided a property discharges the functional role set out in the network analysis, it counts as the realizer of the truth role in that particular domain of discourse.

So far, it may not seem as though there is a great deal distinguishing SOF from OCMP, but the main point of difference becomes apparent when SOF says a bit more about the truth property. Functionalists in general, according to Lynch, have two options when characterizing the truth property: they can either hold that truth is a second-order property - the property of having a property that plays the specified role - or hold – in each domain - that truth is a first-order property, that is, the property that plays that certain role in that domain. The truth property could thus be taken to be either the second-order property of possessing some property that plays the truth role, or, in each domain, the property that actually plays that role in a particular domain of discourse. SOF plumps for the former, and, as a result, the truth property is to be thought of as a second-order functional role property, not as a realizer property. There is a single second-order role property, and a plurality of realizer properties across discourses, and the truth property is to be identified with the former.


There is thus a property that all truths have in common on the SOF view. All truths will have the property of having a property that plays the truth role. As the truth property is to be identified with this second-order property, as opposed to the first-order realizer property, all truths will be true in virtue of having this second-order property, whatever their individual realizer properties are.

There are two main problems that SOF faces. The first concerns the ‘robustness’ of second-order properties. Remember that truth, considered here as a second-order property, needs to be robust enough to ground truth as a general norm of inquiry. However, one might think that the robust properties here are the first-order properties, like correspondence and coherence, as opposed to the property of having one of those properties, which seems to be a thinner, less complex property. If so, SOF provides us with a truth property which is not fit to ground truth as a general norm of inquiry, and thus fails to move the view significantly beyond OCMP (for concerns like these about second-order properties in general, see Kim 1998). The second, related, problem (raised in Lynch 2009) is that it is questionable whether the second-order truth property will satisfy the truth platitudes. Remember that to be a truth-realizing property, on a functionalist view, a property has to exhibit the features set out in the truth platitudes. The first-order properties must do this, and this is how they are identified in their domains, but does the general second-order property exhibit these features? Lynch argues not, and thus the view is unstable: it offers as a truth property a property which fails to meet its own standards for being considered a truth property.

d. Manifestation Functionalism

In Lynch 2009, Lynch presents a significant revision of his earlier proposal. Lynch maintains the central role afforded to the list of platitudes about truth, holding that the concept of truth is captured by the following (slightly different) list:

Objectivity: The belief that p is true if, and only if, with respect to the belief that p, things are as they are believed to be.

Warrant Independence: Some beliefs can be true but not warranted and some can be warranted without being true.

Norm of Belief: It is prima facie correct to believe that p if and only if the proposition that p is true.

End of Inquiry: Other things being equal, true beliefs are a worthy goal of inquiry. (Lynch 2009: 8-12)

According to MF, we ought to take the truth platitudes (or the ‘truish features’ in Lynch’s words) to specify the nature of the truth property, as well as the nature of the truth concept:

the functionalist...can claim that there is a single property and concept of truth. The property being true (or the property of truth) is the property that has the truish features essentially or which plays the truth-role as such. (Lynch 2009: 74)

MF does not disregard the ‘domain-specific’ properties, such as correspondence and superassertibility, but MF does not want to identify truth with these properties, rather that truth is manifested in these properties:

this approach allows the functionalist to claim that truth is, as it were, immanent in ontologically distinct properties. Let us say that where property F is immanent in or manifested by property M, it is a priori that F’s essential features are a subset of M’s features. (Lynch 2009: 74)

MF thus requires that the truth features - as expressed in the characterisation of the truth property - are a subset of the features of the particular domain-specific properties. That is, each of the properties that, in Lynch’s terms, ‘manifest’ truth in a domain, must contain the truth property as a proper part. So, for example, for superassertibility to manifest truth in a domain, it would have to be part of the features of superassertibility that the belief that p is superassertible if, and only if, things are as they are believed to be; that some beliefs can be superassertible but not warranted and some can be warranted without being superassertible; that it is prima facie correct to believe that p if and only if the proposition that p is superassertible; and that, other things being equal, superassertible beliefs are a worthy goal of inquiry.

A key issue for this view is the metaphysics of manifestation. Lynch claims that the metaphysics of manifestation are similar to the metaphysics of the determinate/determinable relation. A classic example of this relation is the relation between being coloured and being red. There is an asymmetry between these properties: if something is red, then, necessarily, it is coloured, whereas if something is coloured it is not necessarily red. Being red, we might say, is one way of being coloured. One way of putting this point is to say that being red is a determinate of the more general determinable, being coloured. According MF, something similar occurs in the case of truth, where properties such as correspondence and superassertibility are different ways of being true. (However, Lynch does not want to say that the manifestation relation as it occurs in the case of truth is the same as the determinate/determinable relation: see Lynch 2009: 75 for details.)

Perhaps the most pressing objection, due to Wright (2012), concerns the ability of properties such as correspondence and superassertibility to manifest truth on the terms of Lynch’s view. Recall that Lynch holds that the truth-manifesting properties contain the essential features of truth as a proper part of their own features. But, Wright argues, if Lynch’s view in general is correct, then surely one of the essential features of truth is that truth is manifested in, for example, correspondence and superassertibility. However, now it looks difficult for those properties to manifest truth, for it cannot be that correspondence and superassertibility are themselves manifested in correspondence and superassertibility. But, if this cannot be the case, then they cannot manifest truth, for they do not possess one of the essential features of truth. Lynch (2012) attempts to respond to this problem, and Wright (2012) also considers his response.

As was the case with SOF, there has also been discussion of how far MF progresses beyond deflationism, and, in particular, whether the property MF identifies with truth – the property that has the truish features essentially – is a property which is as robust as Lynch claims it to be. This issue is discussed in detail in Jarvis 2012, Edwards 2012 and Pedersen and Edwards 2011.

e. Disjunctivism and Simple Determination Pluralism

In addition to the proposals put forward by Crispin Wright and Michael Lynch, there are also a couple of emerging views in the recent literature. The first is the ‘disjunctivist’ proposal offered by Pedersen (2010) and Pedersen and C.D. Wright (2012). The basic idea behind this view is to take the basic structure of OCMP, and add an additional property that will serve as a general truth property. This property will be a disjunctive property which contains each of the domain-specific truth properties as disjuncts.

Pedersen expresses the domain-specific truth properties (of which correspondence to reality and superassertibility are examples) as properties Tl … Tn. His thought is that the existence of a further property can immediately be inferred, a ‘universal’ notion of truth - TU - defined in the following way:

(∀p)(TU (p) ↔ Tl(p) v … v Tn(p))

This states that if we have properties Tl … Tn, we can immediately infer the existence of a further property, TU, by noting that a proposition (p) has TU just when it has one of Tl … Tn. The thought is that this property, TU, has the pedigree to be considered a truth property (it is taken to be possessed by all and only truths, after all). We can call this proposal ‘disjunctivism’, as the single truth property is taken to be a disjunctive property.

The main challenge for disjunctivism is to show that the disjunctive truth property has the necessary credentials to be considered the truth property. In particular, it faces concerns that a disjunctive property is not ‘robust’ enough to meet the requirements of being a substantive norm of inquiry, and also that, as with SOF, it fails to guarantee exhibition of the features laid out in the truth platitudes. Disjunctive proposals are defended from these concerns by Pedersen and Wright (2012a) and Edwards (2012).

The second emerging view is offered by Edwards (2011a, 2012b), which draws upon Dummett’s (1978) analogy between truth and winning. Just as winning is the aim of playing a game, truth is the aim of assertion and belief. It is evident that what it takes to win differs from game to game, but there is good reason to think that winning qua property has a significant degree of constancy. The thought is that the property of being a winner is a property that one can get in a variety of different ways, and that the rules of each game establish a property the possession of which determines the possession of the property of being a winner. Thus, in each game, we get biconditionals of the form:

(Bx) When playing game x: one wins (has the property of winning) iff one possesses property F.

The thought is that this structure can be applied to the truth case. Take it that truth qua property is exhaustively accounted for by the list of platitudes about truth. We can then, for each domain, construct biconditionals of the following form:

(Bdx) In domain of discourse x: <p> is true (has the property of truth) iff <p> has property F.

There will be an order of determination on the biconditionals which reflects the explanatory primacy of the right-to-left direction. That is, in the material world domain, for example, it is because <p> corresponds to the facts that <p> is true, and not because <p> is true that <p> corresponds to the facts. It is in virtue of the order of determination on these biconditionals that we can say that the properties in question determine truth in their respective domains.

The structure of simple determination pluralism is thus as follows. Truth is given as the property that is exhaustively described by the truth platitudes. This property is the property possessed by all true propositions, regardless of domain. This allows the view to avoid the problem with SOF, as the truth property necessarily exhibits the truth features. Moreover, for each domain there will be a property that determines possession of the truth property, and these properties are held fully distinct from the truth property itself. This allows simple determination pluralism to avoid some of the problems with MF as truth itself is not considered to be manifested in the domain-specific properties. The relationship between the truth-determining properties and truth is underwritten by the order of determination on the biconditionals of the form (Bdx).

A key issue for simple determination pluralism is the specification of the relationship between the domain-specific truth-determining properties and the truth property itself. There is also the matter of how exactly the truth-determining properties are identified, and the provenance of the (Bdx) biconditionals. These issues are explored in Edwards 2011a and 2011c, and in Wright 2012.

5. General Issues

These are some of the main formulations of truth pluralism that are currently available. Evidently, the intricacies of each view are more complex than I have been able to outline here, and the reader is directed to the relevant references for more on the structure and motivations for each view. I hope, though, that it is clear that the term ‘truth pluralism’ covers a variety of different proposals which, although they share a certain general approach to truth, differ on the details.

Each proposal, then, faces specific challenges of its own, but there are also some concerns about the general project which all pluralists will need to address. I will close by briefly noting three such concerns.

a. The Problem of Domain Individuation

Truth pluralism seemingly rests on the idea that natural language can be separated into different domains of discourse. Note that this rough separation of thought and talk into different domains is not solely the work of truth pluralists, it is perhaps a separation that is subscribed to, though a lot less explicitly, by a number of different kinds of theorists. The very fact that philosophy itself is separated into different areas corresponding to these divisions might be one example: moral philosophy is taken to concern different subject matter to aesthetics, and philosophy of mathematics different to the philosophy of science. Also, those who take particular positions in these areas may be implicitly subscribing to such distinctions. One who claims to be an expressivist about moral discourse, for example, will need to be able to demarcate what is moral discourse and what is not. Likewise, one who is a fictionalist about mathematics needs some distinction between what are mathematical statements, and what are not.

However, one might think that pluralism is committed to this idea in a particularly acute way. For instance, some of the views above use the notion of a domain as a parameter when it comes to platitude satisfaction. For example, on the OCMP view, truth properties do not satisfy the truth platitudes simpliciter, they satisfy them in a specific domain. Identifying precisely what a domain of discourse is, and how, exactly, they are to be individuated is an issue which has been at the forefronts of the minds of those sceptical of the pluralist project since its inception (see, for example, Williamson 1994), and, at present, one might think that more needs to be done to ease these concerns.

b. The Demandingness Objection

The supposed benefit of being able to use different theories of truth in different domains may be considered a problem when one considers what that entails, namely that a truth pluralist is committed to defending the use of a particular theory of truth in each domain. This worry is particularly acute when one considers that there is no generally accepted version of any of the theories of truth usually cited as examples. For instance, although it may seem a benefit that truth pluralism allows correspondence theory a limited scope, it is worth noting that there is general scepticism over whether there is a satisfactory formulation of the correspondence theory to start with. The same may well be true of coherence theory. Truth pluralism thus inherits the problems with formulating each of the different theories of truth it wants to use in each of its domains. This makes it a very demanding view to defend: not only does it have to find a structure that works, it has to outline and defend each account of truth in each domain. This point is developed by C.D. Wright (2011).

c. Problems with Platitudes

All of the pluralist views I have discussed involve the notion of platitudes at some stage in the theory. As is also clear, different formulations favour slightly different platitudes. This disagreement might make us worry about the use of the term ‘platitude’, which seems to signify some uncontroversial, even obvious, principle. However, although the platitudes in each case are taken to stem from some intuitive thoughts about truth, the eventual formulations may be open to dispute (see Wright 2003: 271, and also Nolan 2009 for more on platitudes), so we should think of them as refined conceptual truths, perhaps, as opposed to simple obvious, uncontroversial, statements. Nevertheless, one might be concerned that there are no platitudes about truth: no principles that are entitled to this status. This is backed up by the fact that most (if not all) of the platitudes cited by truth pluralists have been questioned (C.D. Wright 2005 argues this point, and Lynch 2005 responds).

Usually the scepticism comes from one of two fronts: either from those who think the platitude in question is false, or from those who think the platitude in question is not about truth, and can thus be explained away without committing one to any attitude about the nature of truth. Deflationists about truth often use this second strategy, with Paul Horwich being one prominent example with his discussion of the ‘Norm of Belief’ platitude (see Horwich 1998, 2010). Wolfgang Künne (2003: Chapter 5) gives an example of the first kind of scepticism, arguing that Wright’s ‘Stability’ platitude is false. There are also concerns that even the (in)famous ‘(E)’ platitude is up for grabs, coming from those who wish to admit truth-value gaps, and those who think that the schema leads to paradox (though note that these particular concerns would affect deflationary theories just as much as pluralist theories, given their reliance on the instances of (E)).

Although, as we have seen, disagreement over a platitude does not immediately rule it out as a platitude, there are still issues over the truth of a platitude which need to be taken seriously. Even if pluralists claim that the platitudes are rough formulations approximating some conceptual truth that would be reached when appropriately refined, there is still room for scepticism.

d. The Deflationary Challenge

Throughout contemporary debates on truth pluralism, lurking in the shadows has been the challenge from deflationary theories of truth. In particular, there is an underlying puzzlement as to why we need to go beyond deflationism into pluralism. After all, deflationism and pluralism share some of the same motivations in that they are both dissatisfied with traditional ‘monist’ accounts of truth, yet the deflationary account seemingly offers a far simpler solution to this dissatisfaction, without a lot of the problems for pluralism we have discussed above. The basic worry seems to be: why bring in all of these complications when we can get by with far less? This challenge is compounded by the influence of deflationary theories of truth in current debates, with many holding that deflationism ought to be considered the default view of truth (see, for example, Field 1994, Armour-Garb Beall 2000, and Dodd 2012). As noted above, this challenge has not been ignored by pluralists, with Wright (1992) and Lynch (2009: Chapter 6) building arguments against deflationism into the motivations for their pluralist views. However, despite this work, it is probably still fair to say that one of the central challenges facing pluralists today is to convince those in the deflationary camp that there are strong reasons to consider pluralism an attractive alternative.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W.P. 1996. A Realist Conception of Truth. Cornell University Press.
  • Alston, W.P. 2002. Truth: Concept and Property. In What is Truth? ed. R. Schantz. Berlin and New York: Walter de Gruyter: 11-26.
  • Beall, J.C. 2000. On Mixed Inferences and Pluralism about Truth Predicates. The Philosophical Quarterly Vol. 50, No. 200: 380-382.
  • Boghossian, P.A. 1990. The Status of Content. The Philosophical Review, Vol. 99, No. 2: 157-184.
  • Cotnoir, A.J. 2009. Generic Truth and Mixed Conjunctions: Some Alternatives. Analysis, Vol. 69, No.2: 473-479.
  • Cotnoir, A.J. 2012. Validity for Strong Pluralists. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.
  • Davidson, D. 1999. The Folly of Trying to Define Truth. Journal of Philosophy 93, no. 6: 263-279.
  • Devitt, M. 2001. The Metaphysics of Truth. In Lynch (ed.) 2001.
  • Dodd, J. 2012. Deflationism Trumps Pluralism! In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
  • Dummett, M. 1978. Truth. In his Truth and Other Enigmas. Oxford University Press.
  • Edwards, D. 2008. How to Solve the Problem of Mixed Conjunctions. Analysis, Vol. 68, No. 2: 143-149.
  • Edwards, D. 2009. Truth-Conditions and the Nature of Truth: Re-Solving Mixed Conjunctions. Analysis, Vol. 69, No. 4: 684-688
  • Edwards, D. 2011a. Simplifying Alethic Pluralism. The Southern Journal of Philosophy 49: 28-48.
  • Edwards, D. 2011b. Naturalness, Representation, and the Metaphysics of Truth. European Journal of Philosophy.
  • Edwards, D. 2012a. On Alethic Disjunctivism. dialectica, Vol. 66, Issue 1: 200-214.
  • Edwards, D. 2012b. Truth, Winning, and Simple Determination Pluralism. In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
  • Edwards, D. 2012c. Alethic vs Deflationary Functionalism. International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 20 (1): 115-124.
  • Field, H. 1986. The Deflationary Conception of Truth. In C. Wright and G. Macdonald (eds.) Fact, Science and Morality. Blackwell, Oxford: 55-119.
  • Field, H. 1994. Deflationist Views of Meaning and Content. Mind, 103: 247-285.
  • Horgan, T. 2001. Contextual Semantics and Metaphysical Realism: Truth as Indirect Correspondence. In Lynch 2001: 67-96.
  • Horwich, P. 1996. Realism Minus Truth. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 56: 877-881.
  • Horwich, P. 1998. Truth: Second Edition. Blackwell.
  • Horwich, P. 2010. Truth-Meaning-Reality. Oxford University Press.
  • Jackson, F. 1998. From Metaphysics to Ethics. Oxford University Press.
  • Jackson, F., Oppy, G. and Smith, M. 1994. Minimalism and Truth Aptness. Mind, New Series, Vol. 103, No. 411: 287-302.
  • James, W. 1975. Pragmatism and The Meaning of Truth. Harvard University Press.
  • Jarvis, B. 2012. Truth as One and Very Many. International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 20 (1):
  • Kim, J. 1998. Mind in a Physical World. MIT Press.
  • Kölbel, M. 1997. Wright’s Argument from Neutrality. Ratio NS 10: 35-47.
  • Künne, W. 2003. Conceptions of Truth. Oxford University Press.
  • Lewis, D. 1972. Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 50: 249-58.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2001. The Nature of Truth. MIT Press.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2001a. A Functionalist Theory of Truth. In Lynch 2001.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2004. Truth and Multiple Realizibility. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, Volume 82, Number 3: 384-408.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2004a. Minimalism and the Value of Truth. The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 54, No. 217: 497-517.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2005. Alethic Functionalism and our Folk Theory of Truth. Synthese Vol. 145, No. 1: 29-43.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2006. ReWrighting Pluralism. The Monist, Vol. 89, No. 1: 63-84.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2009. Truth as One and Many. Oxford University Press.
  • Lynch, M.P. 2012. Three Questions about Truth. In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
  • Mackie, J.L. 1977. Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. Penguin.
  • Miller, A. 2001. On Wright’s Argument against Deflationism. The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 51, No. 205: 527-531.
  • Nolan, D. 2009. Platitudes and Metaphysics. In D. Braddon-Mitchell and R. Nola (eds.) Conceptual Analysis and Philosophical Naturalism. MIT Press.
  • Pedersen, N. 2006. What Can the Problem of Mixed Inferences Teach Us about Alethic Pluralism? The Monist, Vol. 89, No. 1: 102-117.
  • Pedersen, N. 2010. Stabilizing Alethic Pluralism. The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 60, No. 238: 92-108.
  • Pedersen, N. and Edwards, D. 2011. Truth as One(s) and Many: On Lynch’s Alethic Functionalism. Analytic Philosophy, 52 (63): 213-30.
  • Pedersen, N. and Wright, C.D. (eds.) 2012. Truth and Pluralism: Current Debates. Oxford University Press.
  • Pedersen, N. and Wright, C.D. 2012a. Why Alethic Disjunctivism is Relatively Compelling. In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.
  • Pedersen, N. and Wright, C.D. 2012b. Pluralist Theories of Truth. Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Rumfitt, I. 1995. Truth Wronged. Ratio, NS 8: 100-7.
  • Sher, G. 2004. In Search of a Substantive Theory of Truth. Journal of Philosophy, 101: 5-36.
  • Smith, M. 1994. The Moral Problem. Blackwell.
  • Stoljar, D. and Damnjanovic, N. 2010. The Deflationary Theory of Truth. Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
  • Tappolet, C. 1997. Mixed Inferences: A Problem for Pluralism about Truth Predicates. Analysis 57: 209-10
  • Tappolet, C. 2000. Truth, Pluralism and Many-Valued Logics. The Philosophical Quarterly, Vol. 50, No. 200: 382-383.
  • Tarksi, A. 1944. The Semantic Conception of Truth and the Foundations of Semantics. Reprinted in A.P. Martinich (ed.) The Philosophy of Language. Oxford University Press. 2001.
  • Van Cleve, J. 1996. Minimal Truth is Realist Truth. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 56: 869-75.
  • White, A. 1957. Truth as Appraisal. Mind 66, No. 263: 318-330.
  • Williamson, T. 1994. A Critical Study of Truth and Objectivity. International Journal of Philosophical Studies 30.1: 130-44.
  • Wright, C.D. 2005. On the Functionalization of Pluralist Approaches to Truth. Synthese Vol. 145, No. 1: 128.
  • Wright, C.D. 2010. Truth, Ramsification, and the Pluralist’s Revenge. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, Vol. 88, No. 2, pp. 265283.
  • Wright, C.D. 2011. Is Pluralism about Truth Inherently Unstable? Philosophical Studies.
  • Wright, C.J.G. 1992. Truth and Objectivity. Harvard University Press.
  • Wright, C.J.G. 2001. Minimalism, Deflationism, Pragmatism, Pluralism. In Lynch (ed.) 2001.
  • Wright, C.J.G. 2003. Truth: A Traditional Debate Reviewed. In his Saving the Differences. Harvard University Press.
  • Wright, C.J.G. 2012. A Plurality of Pluralisms. In Pedersen and Wright (eds.) 2012.


Author Information

Douglas Edwards
Northern Institute of Philosophy, University of Aberdeen
United Kingdom

Ordinary Language Philosophy

Ordinary Language philosophy, sometimes referred to as ‘Oxford’ philosophy, is a kind of ‘linguistic’ philosophy. Linguistic philosophy may be characterized as the view that a focus on language is key to both the content and method proper to the discipline of philosophy as a whole (and so is distinct from the Philosophy of Language). Linguistic philosophy includes both Ordinary Language philosophy and Logical Positivism, developed by the philosophers of the Vienna Circle (for more detail see Analytic Philosophy section 3). These two schools are inextricably linked historically and theoretically, and one of the keys to understanding Ordinary Language philosophy is, indeed, understanding the relationship it bears to Logical Positivism. Although Ordinary Language philosophy and Logical Positivism share the conviction that philosophical problems are ‘linguistic’ problems, and therefore that the method proper to philosophy is ‘linguistic analysis’, they differ vastly as to what such analysis amounts to, and what the aims of carrying it out are.

Ordinary Language philosophy is generally associated with the (later) views of Ludwig Wittgenstein, and with the work done by the philosophers of Oxford University between approximately 1945-1970. The origins of Ordinary Language philosophy reach back, however, much earlier than 1945 to work done at Cambridge University, usually marked as beginning in 1929 with the return of Wittgenstein, after some time away, to the Cambridge faculty. It is often noted that G. E. Moore was a great influence on the early development of Ordinary Language philosophy (though not an Ordinary Language philosopher himself), insofar as he initiated a focus on and interest in ‘commonsense’ views about reality. Major figures of Ordinary Language philosophy include (in the early phases) John Wisdom, Norman Malcolm, Alice Ambrose, Morris Lazerowitz, and (in the later phase) Gilbert Ryle, J. L. Austin and P. F. Strawson, amongst others. However, it is important to note that the Ordinary Language philosophical view was not developed as a unified theory, nor was it an organized program, as such. Indeed, the figures we now know as ‘Ordinary Language’ philosophers did not refer to themselves as such – it was originally a term of derision, used by its detractors. Ordinary Language philosophy is (besides an historical movement) foremost a methodology – one which is committed to the close and careful study of the uses of the expressions of language, especially the philosophically problematic ones. A commitment to this methodology as that which is proper to, and most fruitful for, the discipline of philosophy, is what unifies an assortment of otherwise diverse and independent views.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Cambridge
    1. Analysis and Formal Logic
    2. Logical Atomism
    3. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language
    4. Ordinary Language versus Ideal Language
  3. Ordinary Language Philosophy: Nothing is Hidden
    1. The Misuses of Language
    2. Philosophical Disputes and Linguistic Disputes
    3. Ordinary Language is Correct Language
    4. The Paradigm Case Argument
    5. A Use-Theory of Linguistic Meaning
  4. Oxford
    1. Ryle
    2. Austin
    3. Strawson
  5. The Demise of Ordinary Language Philosophy: Grice
  6. Contemporary Views
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Analysis and Formal Logic
    2. Logical Atomism
    3. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language
    4. Early Ordinary Language Philosophy
    5. The Paradigm Case Argument
    6. Oxford Ordinary Language Philosophy
    7. Criticism of Ordinary Language Philosophy
    8. Contemporary views
    9. Historical and Other Commentaries

1. Introduction

For Ordinary Language philosophy, at issue is the use of the expressions of language, not expressions in and of themselves. So, at issue is not, for example, ordinary versus (say) technical words; nor is it a distinction based on the language used in various areas of discourse, for example academic, technical, scientific, or lay, slang or street discourses – ordinary uses of language occur in all discourses. It is sometimes the case that an expression has distinct uses within distinct discourses, for example, the expression ‘empty space’. This may have both a lay and a scientific use, and both uses may count as ordinary; as long as it is quite clear which discourse is in play, and thus which of the distinct uses of the expression is in play. Though connected, the difference in use of the expression in different discourses signals a difference in the sense with which it is used, on the Ordinary Language view. One use, say the use in physics, in which it refers to a vacuum, is distinct from its lay use, in which it refers rather more flexibly to, say, a room with no objects in it, or an expanse of land with no buildings or trees. However, on this view, one sense of the expression, though more precise than the other, would not do as a replacement of the other term; for the lay use of the term is perfectly adequate for the uses it is put to, and the meaning of the term in physics would not allow speakers to express what they mean in these other contexts.

Thus, the way to understand what is meant by the ‘ordinary use of language’ is to hold it in contrast, not with ‘technical’ use, but with ‘non-standard’ or ‘non-ordinary’ use, or uses that are not in accord with an expression’s ‘ordinary meaning’. Non-ordinary uses of language are thought to be behind much philosophical theorizing, according to Ordinary Language philosophy: particularly where a theory results in a view that conflicts with what might be ordinarily said of some situation. Such ‘philosophical’ uses of language, on this view, create the very philosophical problems they are employed to solve. This is often because, on the Ordinary Language view, they are not acknowledged as non-ordinary uses, and attempt to be passed-off as simply more precise (or ‘truer’) versions of the ordinary use of some expression – thus suggesting that the ordinary use of some expression is deficient in some way. But according to the Ordinary Language position, non-ordinary uses of expressions simply introduce new uses of expressions. Should criteria for their use be provided, according to the Ordinary Language philosopher, there is no reason to rule them out.

Methodologically, ‘attending to the ordinary uses of language’ is held in general to be in opposition to the philosophical project, begun by the Logical Atomists (for more detail on this movement, see below, and the article on Analytic Philosophy, section 2d.) and taken up and developed most enthusiastically by the Logical Positivists, of constructing an ‘ideal’ language. An ideal language is supposed to represent reality more precisely and perspicuously than ordinary language. Ordinary Language philosophy emerged in reaction against certain views surrounding this notion of an ideal language. The ‘Ideal Language’ doctrine (which reached maturity in Logical Positivism) sees ‘ordinary’ language as obstructing a clear view on reality – it is thought to be opaque, vague and misleading, and thus stands in need of reform (at least insofar as it is to deliver philosophical truth).

Contrary to this view, according to Ordinary Language philosophy, it is the attempt to construct an ideal language that leads to philosophical problems, since it involves the non-ordinary uses of language. The key view to be found in the metaphilosophy of the Ordinary Language philosophers is that ordinary language is perfectly well suited to its purposes, and stands in no need of reform – though it can always be supplemented, and is also in a constant state of evolution. On this line of thought, the observation of and attention to the ordinary uses of language will ‘dissolve’ (rather than ‘solve’) philosophical problems – that is, will show them to have not been genuine problems in the first place, but ‘misuses’ of language.

On the positive side, the analysis of the ordinary uses of language may actually lead to philosophical knowledge, according to at least some versions of the view. But, the caveat is, the knowledge proper to philosophy is knowledge (or, rather, improved understanding) of the meanings of the expressions we use (and thus, what we are prepared to count as being described by them), or knowledge of the ‘conceptual’ structures our use of language reflects (our ‘ways of thinking about and experiencing things’). Wittgenstein himself would have argued that this ‘knowledge’ is nothing new, that it was available to all of us all along – all we had to do was notice it through paying proper attention to language use. Later Ordinary Language philosophers such as Strawson, however, argued that this did count as new knowledge – for it made possible new understanding of our experience of reality. Hence, on this take, philosophy does not merely have a negative outcome (the ‘dissolution’ of philosophical problems), and Ordinary Language philosophy need not be understood as quietist or even nihilist as has been sometimes charged. It does, however, turn out to be a somewhat different project to that which it is traditionally conceived to be.

2. Cambridge

The genesis of Ordinary Language philosophy occurred in the work of Wittgenstein after his 1929 return to Cambridge. This period, roughly up to around 1945, represents the early period of Ordinary Language philosophy that we may characterize as ‘Wittgensteinian’. We shall examine these roots first, before turning to its later development at Oxford (which we will continue to call ‘Oxford’ philosophy for convenience) – development that saw significant evolution and variation in the view.

The Cambridge period may be characterized as ‘Wittgensteinian’ because the Ordinary Language philosophers of the time were close followers of Wittgenstein. Many were his pupils at Cambridge, or associates of those pupils who later traveled to other parts of the world transmitting Wittgenstein’s thought, including Ambrose, Lazerowitz, Malcolm, Gasking, Paul, Von Wright, Black, Findlay, Bouwsma and Anscombe to name a few. (See P. M. S. Hacker (1996) for a more detailed historical account, and biographical details, of the Cambridge and Oxford associates of Wittgenstein.) They cleaved closely to the views they believed they found in Wittgenstein’s work, much of which was distributed about Cambridge, and eventually Oxford, as manuscripts or lecture notes that were not published until some time later (for example The Blue and Brown Books (1958) and the seminal Philosophical Investigations (1953)).

These ‘Wittgensteinians’ developed and propounded certain ideas and views, and indeed arguments and theories that Wittgenstein himself may not have approved (nor did Wittgenstein himself ever accept any label for his work, let alone ‘Ordinary Language’ philosophy). The Wittgensteinians saw themselves as developing and extending Wittgenstein’s views, despite the fact that the key principle in Wittgenstein’s work (both earlier and later) was that philosophical ‘theses’, as such, cannot be stated. Wittgenstein steadfastly denied that his work amounted to a philosophical theory because, according to him, philosophy cannot ‘explain’ anything; it may only ‘describe’ what is anyway the case (Philosophical Investigations, section 126-128). The Wittgensteinians developed more explicit arguments that tried to explain and justify the method of appeal to ordinary language than did Wittgenstein. Nevertheless, it is possible to understand what they were doing as remaining faithful to the Wittgensteinian tenet that one cannot propound philosophical theses insofar as claims about meaning are not in themselves theses about meaning. Indeed, the view was that the appeal to the ordinary uses of language is an act of reminding us of how some term or expression is used anyway – to show its meaning rather than explain it.

The first stirrings of the Ordinary Language views emerged as a reaction against the prevailing Logical Atomist, and later, Logical Positivist views that had been initially (ironically) developed by Wittgenstein himself, and published in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus in 1921. In order to understand this reaction, we must take a brief look at the development of Ideal Language philosophy, which formed the background against which Ordinary Language philosophy arose.

a. Analysis and Formal Logic

Around the turn of the 20th century, in the earliest days of the development of Analytic philosophy, Russell and Moore (in particular) developed the methods of ‘analysis’ of problematic notions. These methods involved, roughly, ‘re-writing’ a philosophically problematic term or expression so as to render it ‘clearer’, or less problematic, in some sense. This itself involved a focus on language – or on the ‘proposition’ – as part of the methodology of philosophy, which was quite new at the time.

This new spirit of precision and rigor paid particular attention to Gottlob Frege’s groundbreaking work in formal logic (1879), which initiated the development of the truth-functional view of language. A logical system is truth-functional if all its sentential operators (words such as ‘and’, ‘or’, ‘not’ and ‘if…then’) are functions that take truth-values as arguments and yield truth-values as their output. The conception of a truth-functional language is deeply connected with that of the truth-conditional conception of meaning for natural language. On this view, the truth-condition of a sentence is its meaning – it is that in virtue of which an expression has a meaning – and the meaning of a compound sentence is determined by the meanings of its constituent parts, that is the words that compose it. This is known as the principle of compositionality (see Davidson’s Philosophy of Language, section 1a, i).

Although formal symbolic logic was developed initially in order to analyze and explore the structure of arguments, in particular the structure of ‘validity’, its success soon led many to see applications for it within the realm of natural language. Specifically, the thought began to emerge that the logic that was being captured in ever more sophisticated systems of symbolic logic was the structure that is either actually hidden beneath natural, ordinary language, or it is the structure which, if not present in ordinary language, ought to be. What emerges in connection with the development of the truth-functional and truth-conditional view of language is the idea that the surface form of propositions may not represent their ‘true’ (or truth-functional) logical form. Indeed, Russell’s ‘On Denoting’ in 1905, which proposed a thesis called the Theory of Descriptions, argues just that: that underlying the surface grammar of ordinary expressions was a distinct logical form. His method of the ‘logical analysis of language’, based on the attempt to ‘analyze’ (or ‘re-write’) the propositions of ordinary language into the propositions of an ideal language, became known as the ‘paradigm of philosophy’ (as described by Ramsey in his 1931, pp. 321).

Both Russell and Frege recognized that natural language did not always, on the surface at any rate, behave like symbolic logic. Its elementary propositions, for example, were not always determinately true or false; some were not truth-functional, or compositional, at all (such as those in ‘opaque contexts’ like “Mary believes she has a little lamb”) and so on. In ‘On Denoting’ Russell proposed that despite misleading surface appearances, many (ideally, all) of the propositions of ordinary language could nevertheless be rewritten as transparently truth-functional propositions (that is, those that can be the arguments of truth-functions, and whose values are determinately either true or false, as given by their truth-conditions). That is, he argued, they could be ‘analyzed’ in such a way as to reveal the true logical form of the proposition, which may be obscured beneath the surface grammatical form of the proposition.

The proposition famously treated to Russell’s logical analysis in ‘On Denoting’ is the following: “The present King of France is bald.” We do not know how to treat this proposition truth-functionally if there is no present King of France – it does not have a clear truth-value in this case. But all propositions that can be the arguments of truth-functions must be determinately either true or false. The surface grammar of the proposition appears to claim of some object X, that it is bald. Therefore, it would appear that the proposition is true or false depending on whether X is bald or not bald. But there is no X. Russell’s achievement lies in his analysis of this proposition in (roughly and non-symbolically) the following way, which rendered it truth-functional (such that the truth-value of the whole is a function of the truth-values of the parts) after all: instead of “The present King of France is bald,” we read (or analyze the proposition as) “There is one, and only one, object X such that X is the present King of France (and) X is bald.” Now the proposition is comprised of elementary propositions governed by an existential quantifier (plus a ‘connective’– the word ‘and’), which can now be treated perfectly truth-functionally, and can return a determinately true or false value. Since the elementary proposition that claims that there is such an X is straightforwardly false, then by the rules of the propositional calculus this renders the entire complex proposition straightforwardly false. This had the result that it was no longer necessary to agonize over whether something that does not exist can be bald or not!

b. Logical Atomism

To the view that logical analysis would reveal a ‘logically perfect’ truth-functional language that lurked beneath ordinary language (but was obscured by it), Russell added that the most elementary constituents of the true logical form of a proposition (‘logical atoms’) correspond with the most elementary constituents of reality. This combination of views constituted his Logical Atomism (for more detail see Analytic Philosophy, section 2d). According to Russell, the simple parts of propositions represent the simple parts of the world. And just as more complex propositions are built up out of simpler ones, so the complex facts and objects in reality are built up out of simpler ones (Russell 1918).

Thus, the notion of the ‘true logical form’ of propositions was not only thought to be useful for working out how arguments functioned, and whether they were valid, but for a wider metaphysical project of representing how the world really is. The essence of Russellian Logical Atomism is that once we analyze language into its true logical form, we can simply read off from it the ultimate ontological structure of reality. The basic assumption at work here, which formed the foundation for the Ideal Language view, is that the essential and fundamental purpose of language is to represent the world. Therefore, the more ‘perfect’, that is ‘ideal’, the language, the more accurately it represents the world. A logically perfect language is, on this line of thought, a literal mirror of metaphysical reality. Russell’s work encouraged the view that language is meaningful in virtue of this underlying representational and truth-functional nature.

The Ideal Language view gave weight to the growing suspicion that ordinary language actually obscured our access to reality, because it obscured true logical form. Perhaps, the thought went, ordinary language does not represent the world as it really is. For example, the notion of a non-existent entity, suggested in the proposition about ‘the present King of France’ was simply one which arose because of the misleading surface structure of ordinary language, which, when properly ‘analyzed’, revealed there was no true ontological commitment to such a paradoxical entity at all.

Wittgenstein, in his Tractatus, took these basic ideas of Logical Atomism to a more sophisticated level, but also provided the materials for the development of the views by the Logical Positivists. An ideal language, according to Wittgenstein, was understood to actually share a structure with metaphysical reality. On this view, between language and reality there was not mere correspondence of elements, but isomorphism of form – reality shares the ‘logical form’ of language, and is pictured in it. Wittgenstein’s version of Atomism became known as the ‘picture theory’ of language, and ultimately became the focus of the view he later rejected. A rather confounding part of Wittgenstein’s argument in the Tractatus is that although this picturing relation between reality and language exists, it cannot itself be represented, and nor therefore spoken of in language. Thus, according to Wittgenstein, the entire Tractatus attempts to say what cannot be said, and is therefore a form of ‘nonsense’ – once its lessons are absorbed, he advised, it must then be rejected, like a ladder to be kicked away once one has stepped up it to one’s destination (1921, section 6.54).

c. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language

The Vienna Circle, where the doctrine of Logical Positivism (or ‘Logical Empiricism’ as it was sometimes called) was developed, included philosophers such as Schlick, Waismann, Neurath, and Carnap, amongst others. (See Coffa 1991, chapter 13 for an authoritative history of this period in Vienna.) This group was primarily interested in the philosophy of science and epistemology. Unlike the Cambridge analysts, however, who merely thought metaphysics had to be done differently, that is more rigorously, the Logical Positivists thought it should not be done at all. They acquired this rejection of metaphysics from Wittgenstein’s Tractatus.

According to the Tractatus, properly meaningful propositions divided into two kinds only: ‘factual’ propositions which represented, or ‘pictured’, reality and the propositions of logic. The latter, although not meaningless, were nevertheless all tautologous – empty of empirical, factual content. The propositions that fell into neither of these classes – according to Wittgenstein, the propositions of his own Tractatus – were ‘meaningless’ nonsense because, he claimed, they tried to say what could not be said. The Positivists did not accept this part of Wittgenstein’s view however, that is that what defined ‘nonsense’ was trying to say what could not be said. What they did believe was that metaphysical (and other) propositions are nonsense because they cannot be confirmed – there exists no procedure by which they may be verified. For the Positivists, ‘pseudo-propositions’ are those which present themselves as if they were factual propositions, but which are, in fact, not. The proposition, for example, “All atomic propositions correspond to atomic facts” looks like a scientific, factual claim such as “All physical matter is composed of atoms.” But the propositions are not of the same order, according to the Positivists – the former is masquerading as a scientific proposition, but in fact, it is not the sort of proposition that we know how to confirm, or even test. The former has, according to the view, no ‘method of verification’.

Properly ‘empirical’ propositions are those, according to the Positivists, that are ‘about’ the world, they are ‘factual’, have ‘content’ and their truth-values are determined strictly by the way the world is; but most crucially, they can be confirmed or disconfirmed by empirical observation of the world (testing, experimenting, observing via instruments, and so forth). On the other hand, the ‘logical’ propositions, and any that could be reduced to logical propositions for example analytic propositions, were not ‘about’ anything: they determined the form of propositions and structured the body of the properly empirical propositions of science. The so-called ‘Empiricist Theory of Meaning’ is, thus, the view that ‘the meaning of a proposition is its method of verification’, and the so-called ‘Verification Principle’ is the doctrine that if a proposition cannot be empirically verified, and it is not, or is not reducible to, a logical proposition, it is therefore meaningless (see Carnap 1949, pp. 119).

Logical Positivism cemented the Ideal Language view insofar as it accepted all of the elements we have identified; the view that ordinary language is misleading, and that underlying the vagueness and opacity of ordinary language is a precise and perspicuous language that is truth-functional and truth-conditional. From these basic ideas emerged the notion that a meaningful language is meaningful in virtue of having a systematic, and thus formalizable syntactic and semantic structure, which, although it is often obscured in ordinary language, could be revealed with proper philosophical and logical analysis.

It is in opposition to this overall picture that Ordinary Language philosophy arose. Ideal language came to be seen as thoroughly misleading as to the true structure of reality. As Alice Ambrose (1950) noted, ideal language was by this time “…[condemned] as being seriously defective and failing to do what it is intended to do. [This view] gives rise to the idea that [ordinary] language is like a tailored suit that does not fit” (pp. 14-15). Contrary to this notion, according to Ambrose, ordinary language is the very paradigm of meaningfulness. Wittgenstein, for example, said in the Philosophical Investigations that,

On the one hand it is clear that every sentence in our language ‘is in order as it is’. That is to say, we are not striving after an ideal, as if our ordinary vague sentences had not yet got a quite unexceptionable sense, and a perfect language awaited construction by us. - On the other hand it seems clear that where there is sense there must be perfect order. - So there must be perfect order even in the vaguest sentence. (Section 98)

d. Ordinary Language versus Ideal Language

It is notable that, methodologically, Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophy both placed language at the center of philosophy, thus taking the so-called ‘linguistic turn’ (a term coined by Bergmann 1953, pp. 65) – which is to hold the rather more radical position that philosophical problems are (really) linguistic problems.

Certainly both the Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophers argued that philosophical problems arise because of the ‘misuses of language’, and in particular they were united against the metaphysical uses of language. Both complained and objected to what they called ‘pseudo-propositions’. Both saw such ‘misuses’ of language as the source of philosophical problems. But although the Positivists ruled out metaphysical (and many other non-empirically verifiable) uses of language as nonsense on the basis of the Verification Principle, the Ordinary Language philosophers objected to them as concealed non-ordinary uses of language – not to be ruled out, as such, so long as criteria for their use were provided.

The Positivists understood linguistic analysis as the weeding out of nonsense, such that a ‘logic of science’ could emerge (Carnap 1934). A ‘logic of science’ would be based on an ideal language – one which is of a perfectly perspicuous logical form, comprised exhaustively of factual propositions, logical propositions and nothing else. In such a language, philosophical problems would be eliminated because they could not even be formulated. On the other hand, for the Ordinary Language philosophers, the aim was to resolve philosophical confusion, but one could expect to achieve a kind of philosophical enlightenment, or certainly a greater understanding of ourselves and the world, in the process of such resolution: for philosophy is seen as an ongoing practice without an ultimate end-game.

Most strikingly, however, is the difference in the views about linguistic meaning between the Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophers. As we’ve seen, the Ideal language view maintains a truth-functional and representational theory of meaning. The Ordinary Language philosophers held, following Wittgenstein, a use-based theory (or just a ‘use-theory’) of meaning. The exact workings of such a theory have never been fully detailed, but we turn to examine what we can of it below (section 3a). Suffice it to say here that, for the Ordinary Language philosopher, no proposition falls into a class – say ‘empirical’, ‘logical’, ‘necessary’, ‘contingent’ or ‘analytic’ or ‘synthetic’ and so forth in and of itself. That is, it is not, on a use-theory of meaning, the content of a proposition that marks it as belonging to such categories, but the way it is used in the language. (For more on this aspect of a use-theory, see for example Malcolm 1940; 1951.)

3. Ordinary Language Philosophy: Nothing is Hidden

The Ordinary Language philosophers, did not, strictly speaking, ‘reject’ metaphysics (to deny the existence of a metaphysical realm is itself, notice, a metaphysical contention). Rather, they ‘objected’ to metaphysical theorizing for two reasons. Firstly, because they believed it distorted the ordinary use of language, and this distortion was itself a source of philosophical problems. Secondly, they argued that metaphysical theorizing was superfluous to our philosophical needs – metaphysics was, basically, thought to be beside the point. Both objections rested on the view that our ordinary perceptions of the world, and our ordinary use of language to talk about them, are all we need to observe in order to dissipate philosophical perplexity. On this view, metaphysics adds nothing, but poses the danger of distorting what the issues really are. This position rests on Wittgenstein’s insistence that ‘nothing is hidden’.

Wittgenstein’s view was that whatever philosophy does, it simply describes what is open to view to anyone. Philosophy is not, on this approach, a matter of theorizing about ‘how reality really is’ and then confirming such philosophical ‘facts’ – generally, not obvious to everyday experience – through special philosophical techniques, such as analysis. Philosophy is, thus, quite distinct from the empirical sciences – as the Positivists agreed. For Ordinary Language philosophy, however, the distinction did not rest on issues of verification, but on the view that philosophy is a practice rather than an accumulation of knowledge or the discovery of new, special philosophical facts. This runs contrary to the traditional, ‘metaphysical’ view that ‘reality’ is somehow hidden, or underlies the familiar, the everyday reality we experience and must be ‘revealed’ or ‘discovered’ by some special philosophical kind of study or analysis. On the contrary Wittgenstein claimed:

Philosophy simply puts everything before us, and neither explains nor deduces anything.  – Since everything lies open to view there is nothing to explain. (Section 126)

…For nothing is hidden. (Section 435)

Metaphysical theorizing requires that language be used in ways that it is not ordinarily used, according to Wittgenstein, and the task proper to philosophy is to simply remind us what the ordinary uses actually are:

…We must do away with all explanation, and description alone must take its place. And this description gets its light, that is to say its purpose, from the philosophical problems. These are, of course, not empirical problems; they are solved rather by looking into the workings of our language, and that in such a way as to make us recognise these workings; in despite of an urge to misunderstand them. The problems are solved, not by giving new information, but by arranging what we have always known. Philosophy is a battle against the bewitchment of our intelligence by means of language. (Section 109)

What we do is bring words back from their metaphysical to their everyday use. (Section 116)

The idea that philosophical problems could be dissolved by means of the observation of the ordinary uses of language was referred to, mostly derogatively, by its critics as ‘therapeutic positivism’ (see the critical papers by Farrell 1946a and 1946b). It is true that the notion of ‘philosophy as therapy’ is to be found in the texts of Wittgenstein (1953, Section 133) and particularly in Wisdom (1936; 1953). However, the idea of philosophy as therapy was not an idea that was taken too kindly by traditional philosophers. The method was referred to by Russell as “…procurement by theft of what one has failed to gain by honest toil” (quoted in Rorty 1992, pp. 3). This view of philosophy was marked as a kind of ‘quietism’ about the real philosophical problems (a stubborn refusal to address them), and even as a kind of ‘nihilism’ about the prospects of philosophy altogether (once ‘misuses’ of language have been revealed, philosophical problems would disappear). It was only later at Oxford that Ordinary Language philosophy was eventually able to shrug off the association with the view that philosophical perplexity is a ‘disease’ that needed to be ‘cured’.

In the following sections, four important aspects of early Ordinary Language philosophy are examined, along with some of the key objections.

a. The Misuses of Language

In examining the view that metaphysics leads to the distortion of the ordinary uses of language, the question must also be answered as to why this was supposed to be a negative thing – since that is not at all obvious. An account is required of what the Ordinary Language philosophers counted as ‘ordinary’ uses of language, as non-ordinary uses, and why the latter was thought to be the source of philosophical problems, rather than elements of their solution.

The question of what counts as ‘ordinary’ language has been a pivotal point of objection to Ordinary Language philosophy from its earliest days. Some attempts were made by Ryle to get clearer on the matter (see 1953; 1957; 1961). For example, he emphasized, as we noted in the introduction, that it is not words that are of interest, but their uses:

Hume’s question was not about the word ‘cause’; it was about the use of ‘cause’. It was just as much about the use of ‘Ursache’. For the use of ‘cause’ is the same as the use of ‘Ursache’, though ‘cause’ is not the same word as ‘Ursache’. (1953, pp. 28)

He emphasized that the issue was ‘the ordinary use of language’ and not ‘the use of ordinary language’. Malcolm described the notion of the ordinary use of some expression thus:

By an “ordinary expression” I mean an expression which has an ordinary use, i.e. which is ordinarily used to describe a certain sort of situation. By this I do not mean that the expression need be one that is frequently used. It need only be an expression which would be used… To be an ordinary expression it must have a commonly accepted use; it need not be the case that it is ever used. (1942a, pp. 16)

The uses of expressions in question here refer almost entirely to what would ordinarily be said of some situation or state of affairs; what we (language users) would ordinarily call it a case of. So, of interest are the states of affairs that come under philosophical dispute, for example cases which we would ordinarily call cases of, say ‘free-will’, cases of ‘seeing some object’, cases of ‘knowing something for certain’ and so forth. It was Malcolm who, in his 1942a paper, first pointed out that non-ordinary uses of expressions occur in philosophy most particularly when the philosophical thesis propounded ‘goes against ordinary language’ – that is, when what the philosophical thesis proposes to be the case is radically different from what we would ordinarily say about some case (1942a, pp. 8).

To illustrate, take the term ‘knowledge’. According to Malcolm, its use in epistemological skepticism is non-ordinary. If one uttered “I do not know if this is a desk before me,” a hearer may assume that what is meant is that the utterer is unsure about the object before her because, for example the light is bad, or she thinks it might be a dining table instead of a desk or something similar. Something like this would be the, let us say, ordinary use of the term ‘know’. By way of contrast, if the utterer meant, by the expression, ‘I do not know if this is a desk before me, because I do not know the truth of any material-object statement, or I do not know if any independent objects exist outside my mind’ – then, we might say this was a non-ordinary use of the term ‘know’. We have not established that the non-ordinary use is at any disadvantage as yet. However, since if the latter was what one meant when one uttered the original statement, then one would have to explain this use to a hearer (unless the philosophical use was established to be in play at an earlier moment) – that is, one would have to note that “I do not know if this is a desk before me” is being used in a different sense to the other (non-skeptical) one. On this basis, the claim is that the first use is ordinary and the second, non-ordinary. Minimally, the expressions have different uses, and thus different senses, on this argument.

It might be objected that the skeptical use is perfectly ordinary – say, amongst philosophers at least. However, this does not establish that the skeptical use is the ordinary use, because the skeptical use depends on the prior existence, and general acceptance, of the original use. That is, the skeptical claim about knowledge could not even be formulated if it were not assumed that everyone knew the ordinary meaning of the term ‘know’ – if this were not assumed, there would be no point in denying that we have ‘knowledge’ of material-object propositions. Indeed, Ryle noted his sense of this paradox quite early on:

…if the expressions under consideration [in philosophical arguments] are intelligently used, their employers must always know what they mean and do not need the aid or admonition of philosophers before they can understand what they are saying. And if their hearers understand what they are being told, they too are in no such perplexity that they need to have this meaning philosophically “analysed” or “clarified” for them. And, at least, the philosopher himself must know what the expressions mean, since otherwise, he could not know what it was that he was analysing. (1992, pp. 85)

Often, the ordinary use of some expression must be presupposed in order to formulate the philosophical position in which it is used non-ordinarily.

Nevertheless, challenges to the very idea of ordinary versus non-ordinary uses of language came from other quarters. In particular, a vigorous dispute arose over what the criteria were supposed to be to identify ordinary versus non-ordinary uses of language, and why a philosopher assumes herself to have any authority on this matter. For example, Benson Mates argued, in his ‘On the Verifiability of Statements about Ordinary Language’ (1958, 1964) just what the title suggests: how can any such claims be confirmed? This objection applies more seriously to the later Ordinary Language philosophical work, because that period focused on far more detailed analyses of the uses of expressions, and made rather more sweeping claims about ‘what we say’. Stanley Cavell (1958, 1964) responded to Mates that claims as to the ordinary uses of expressions are not empirically based, but are normative claims (that is, they are not, in general, claims about what people do say, but what they can say, or ought to say, within the bounds of the meaning of the expression in question). Cavell also argued that the philosopher, as a member of a linguistic community, was at least as qualified as any other member of that community to make claims about what is, or can be, ordinarily said and meant; although it is always possible that any member of the linguistic community may be wrong in such a claim. The debate has continued, however, with similar objections (to Mates’) raised by Fodor and Katz (1963, 1971), to which Henson (1965) has responded.

The reason this objection applies less-so to the early Ordinary Language philosophers is that, for the Wittgensteinians, claims as to what is ‘ordinarily said’ applied in much more general ways. It applied, for example, to ‘what would ordinarily be said of, for example, a situation’ – for example, as we noted, cases of what we ordinarily call ‘seeing x’, or ‘doing x of her own free-will’, or ‘knowing “x” for certain’ and so forth (these kinds of cases were later argued to be paradigm cases – see below, section 3d, for a discussion of this important argument within early Ordinary Language philosophy). The Wittgensteinians were originally making their points against the kind of skeptical metaphysical views which had currency in their own time; the kinds of theories which suggested such things as ‘we do not know the truth of any material-thing statements’, ‘we are acquainted, in perception, only with sense-data and not external, independent objects’, ‘no sensory experience can be known for certain’ and so on. In such cases there is no question that the ordinary thing to say is, for example “I am certain this is a desk before me,” and “I see the fire-engine” and “It is true that I know that this is a desk” and so forth. In fact, in such disputes it was generally agreed that there was a certain ordinary way of describing such and such a situation. This would be how a situation is identified, so that the metaphysician or skeptical philosopher could proceed to suggest that this way of describing things is false.

The objection that was directed equally at the Wittgensteinians and the Oxford Ordinary Language philosophers was in regard to what was claimed to count as ‘misuses’ of expressions, particularly philosophical ‘misuses’. In particular, it was objected that presumably such uses must be banned according to Ordinary Language philosophy (for example Rollins 1951). Sometimes, it was argued, the non-ordinary use of some expression is philosophically necessary since sometimes technical or more precise terms are needed.

In fact, it was never argued by the Ordinary Language philosophers that any term or use of an expression should be prohibited. The objection is not born out by the actual texts. It was not argued that non-ordinary uses of language in and of themselves were a cause of philosophical problems; the problem lay in, mostly implicitly, attempting to pass them off as ordinary uses. The non-ordinary use of some term or expression is not, merely, a more ‘technical’ or more ‘precise’ use of the term – it is to introduce, or even assume, a quite different meaning for the term. In this sense, a philosophical theory that uses some term or expression non-ordinarily is talking about something entirely different to whatever the term or expression talks about in its ordinary use. Malcolm, for example, argues that the problem with philosophical uses of language is that they are often introduced into discussion without being duly noted as non-ordinary uses. Take, for example, the metaphysical claim that the content of assertions about experiences of an independent realm of material objects can never be certain. The argument (see Malcolm 1942b) is that this is an implicit suggestion that we stop applying the term ‘certain’ to empirical propositions, and reserve it for the propositions of logic or mathematics (which can be exhaustively proven to be true). It is a covert suggestion about how to reform the use of the term ‘certain’. But the suggested use is a ‘misuse’ of language, on the Ordinary Language view (that is, applying the term ‘certain’ only to mathematical or logical propositions). Moreover, the argument presents itself as an argument about the facts concerning the phenomenon of certainty, thus failing to ‘own up’ to being a suggestion about the use of the term ‘certain’ - leaving the assumption that it uses the term according to its ordinary meaning misleadingly in place. The issue, according to Ordinary Language philosophy, is that the two uses of ‘certain’ are distinct and the philosopher’s sense cannot replace the ordinary sense – though it can be introduced independently and with its own criteria, if that can be provided. Malcolm says, for example:

…if it gives the philosopher pleasure always to substitute the expression “I see some sense-data of my wife” for the expression “I see my wife,” etc.and so forth, then he is at liberty thus to express himself, provided he warns people beforehand, so that they will understand him. (1942a, pp. 15)

In an argument Malcolm elsewhere (1951) deals with, he suggests that it is not a ‘correct’ use of language to say, “I feel hot, but I am not certain of it.” But this is not to suggest that the expression must be banned from philosophical theorizing, nor that it is not possible that it might, at some point, become a perfectly correct use of language. What is crucial is that, for any use newly introduced to a language, how that expression is to be used must be explained, that is, criteria for its use must be provided. He says:

We have never learned a usage for a sentence of the sort “I thought that I felt hot but it turned out that I was mistaken.” In such matters we do not call anything “turning out that I was mistaken.” If someone were to insist that it is quite possible that I were mistaken when I say that I feel hot, then I should say to him: Give me a use for those words! I am perfectly willing to utter them, provided that you tell me under what conditions I should say that I was or was not mistaken.  Those words are of no use to me at present. I do not know what to do with them…There is nothing we call “finding out whether I feel hot.” This we could term either a fact of logic or a fact of language. (1951, pp. 332)

Malcolm went so far as to suggest the laws of logic may well, one day, be different to what we accept now (1940, pp. 198), and that we may well reject some necessary statements, should we find a use for their negation, or for treating them as contingent (1940, pp. 201ff). Thus, the objection that, according to Ordinary Language philosophy, non-ordinary uses, or new, revised or technical uses of expressions are to be prohibited from philosophy is generally unfounded – though it is an interpretation of Ordinary Language philosophy that survives into the present day.

b. Philosophical Disputes and Linguistic Disputes

There was no lack of voluble objection to the claim that philosophical disputes are ‘really linguistic’ (or sometimes ‘really verbal’). Therefore, it is essential to understand the Ordinary Language philosophers’ reasons for holding it to be true (although the later Oxford philosophers were generally less committed to it in quite such a rigid form). One of the most explicit formulations of this view is, once again, to be found in Malcolm’s 1942a paper. Its rough outline is this: in certain philosophical disputes the empirical facts of the matter are not at issue – that is to say, the dispute is not based on any lack of access to the empirical facts, the kinds of fact we can, roughly, ‘observe’. If the dispute is not about the empirical facts according to Malcolm, then the only other thing that could be at issue is how some phenomenon is to be described - and that is a ‘linguistic’ issue. This is particularly true of metaphysical disputes, according to Malcolm, who presents as examples the following list of ‘metaphysical’ propositions’ (1942a, pp. 6):

1. There are no material things

2. Time is unreal

3. Space is unreal

4. No-one ever perceives a material thing

5. No material thing exists unperceived

6. All that one ever sees when he looks at a thing is part of his own brain

7. There are no other minds – my sensations are the only sensations that exist

8. We do not know for certain that there are any other minds

9. We do not know for certain that the world was not created five minutes ago

10. We do not know for certain the truth of any statement about material things

11. All empirical statements are hypotheses

12. A priori statements are rules of grammar

According to Malcolm, affirming or denying the truth of any one of these propositions is not affirming or denying a matter of fact, but rather, Malcolm claims, “…it is a dispute over what language shall be used to describe those facts” (1942a, pp. 9). On what basis does he make this claim? The obvious objection on behalf of the metaphysician is that she certainly is talking about ‘the facts’ here, namely the metaphysical facts, and not about language at all.

Malcolm argues thus: he imagines a dispute between Russell and Moore, as illustrated by the propositions noted above. He takes as an example Russell’s assertion that “All that one ever sees when one looks at a thing is part of one’s own brain”. This is the sort of proposition that would follow from the philosophical thesis that all we are acquainted with in perception is sense-data, and that we do not perceive independent, external objects directly (See Russell 1927, pp. 383 – see also Sense-Data). Malcolm casts Moore (unauthorized by Moore it should be noted) as replying to Russell: “This desk which both of us now see is most certainly not part of my brain, and, in fact, I have never seen a part of my own brain” (Malcolm 1942a, pp. 7). We are asked to notice that there is no disagreement, in Russell and Moore’s opposing propositions, about the empirical facts of the matter. The dispute is not that one of either Russell or Moore cannot see the desk properly, or is hallucinating, in disagreeing whether what is before them is, or is not, a desk. That is, Russell and Moore agree that the phenomenon they are talking about is the one that is ordinarily described by saying (for example) “I see before me a desk.”

Malcolm asserts that “Both the philosophical statement, and Moore’s reply to it are disguised linguistic statements” (1942a, pp. 13 – my italics). Malcolm’s claim that this kind of dispute is not ‘empirical’ has less to do with a Positivistically construed notion of ‘verifiability’, and more to do with the contrast such a dispute has with a kind of dispute that really is empirical, or ‘factual’ – in the ordinary sense, where getting a closer look, say, at something would resolve the issue. The argument that the dispute is ‘really linguistic’ rests on Malcolm’s claim that when a philosophical thesis denies the applicability of some ordinary use of language, it is not merely suggesting that, occasionally, when we make certain claims, what we say is false. According to Malcolm, when a philosophical thesis suggests (implicitly), for example, that we should withhold the term ‘certain’ from non-analytic (mathematical or logical) statements, the suggestion is not that it is merely false to say one is certain about a synthetic (material-thing) statement – but that it is logically impossible. Malcolm tries to support his contention by drawing attention to the features apparent in the sort of dispute that is really about ‘the facts’, and one that he regards as, rather, really linguistic:

In ordinary life everyone of us has known of particular cases in which a person has said that he knew for certain that some material-thing statement was true, but that it has turned out that he was mistaken. Someone may have said, for example, that he knew for certain by the smell that it was carrots that were cooking on the stove. But you had just previously lifted the cover and seen that it was turnips, not carrots. You are able to say, on empirical grounds, that in this particular case when the person said that he knew for certain that a material-thing statement was true, he was mistaken…It is an empirical fact that sometimes when people use statements of the form: “I know for certain that p”, where p is a material-thing statement, what they say is false. But when the philosopher asserts that we never know for certain any material-thing statements, he is not asserting this empirical fact…he is asserting that always…when any person says a thing of that sort his statement will be false. (1942a, pp. 11)

So, Malcolm proposes that, since their dispute is not empirical, or contingent, we ought to understand Russell as saying that “…it is really a more correct way of speaking to say that you see part of your brain than to say that you see [for example] a desk” and we have Moore saying that, on the contrary, “It is correct language to say that what we are doing now is seeing [a desk], and it is not correct language to say that what we are doing now is seeing parts of our brains” (1942a, pp. 9).

The obvious objection here is to the claim that the dispute is linguistic rather than about the phenomenon of, for example perception itself. For example, C. A. Campbell (1944) remarks that: seems perfectly clear that what [these] arguments [such as the one’s mentioned by Malcolm] [are] concerned with is the proper understanding of the facts of the situation, and not with any problem of linguistics: and that there is a disagreement about language with the plain man only because there is a disagreement about the correct reading of the facts...The philosopher objects to such [ordinary] statements   only in the context of philosophical discourse where it is vital that our words should accurately describe the facts. (pp. 15)

This objection is further echoed in Morris Weitz (1947), responding to Malcolm’s Ordinary Language treatment of the propositions of epistemic skepticism, such as “no-material thing statement is known for certain”:

The first thing that needs to be pointed out is that philosophers who recommend the abolition of the prefix ‘it is certain that’ as applied to empirical statements do not suggest that the language of common sense is mistaken.  What they mean to say to common sense is that its language is alright provided that its interpretation of the facts is all right. But the interpretation is not all right; therefore, the articulation of the interpretation is mistaken, and needs revision. [Thus]...will we not, and more correctly say, common sense and its language are here in error and....incline a little with Broad to the view that common sense, at least on this issue, ought to go out and hang itself. (pp. 544-545)

A more contemporary version of this objection, which applies to the idea that philosophical disputes are about concepts and thoughts (rather than the ordinary uses of language) may be found in Williamson (2007). He argues that not all philosophy is (the equivalent of) ‘linguistic’, because philosophers may well study objects that have never (as yet) been thought or spoken about at all (‘elusive objects’). He says:

Suppose, just for the sake of argument, that there are no [such] elusive objects. That by itself would still not vindicate a restriction of philosophy to the conceptual, the realm of sense or thought. The practitioners of any discipline have thoughts and communicate them, but they are rarely studying those very thoughts: rather, they are studying what their thoughts are about. Most thoughts are not about thoughts. To make philosophy the study of thought is to insist that philosophers’ thoughts should be about thoughts. It is not obvious why philosophers should accept that restriction. (pp. 17-18)

The general gist of the objection was that philosophy is just as perfectly the study of facts as any other science, except what is under investigation are metaphysical rather than physical facts. There is no reason, on this objection, to understand metaphysical claims as claims about language. The early Ordinary Language philosophers did not formulate a complete response to this charge. Indeed, that the charge is still being raised demonstrates that it still has not been answered to the satisfaction of its critics. Some attempts were made to emphasize, for example, that an inquiry about how some X is to be described ought not be distinguished from an inquiry into the nature of X (for example Austin 1964; Cavell 1958, pp. 91; McDowell 1994, pp. 27) – given that we have no obviously independent way to study such ‘natures’. This appears not to have convinced those who disagree, however.

It was also part of a defence to this objection to appeal to the so-called ‘linguistic doctrine of necessity’. The terminology popular in the day is partly to blame for the general disdain of this view (which was only a ‘doctrine’ as such in the hands of the Positivists), as it sounds as though the claim is that necessary propositions, because they are ‘linguistic’, are not to be understood as being about the world and the way things are in it, but about words, or even about the ways words are used. This of course would have the result that necessary propositions turn out to be contingent propositions about language use, which was correctly recognised to be absurd (as noted in Malcolm 1940, pp. 190-191). This was rather more how the Positivists described the doctrine. For them, the thought in distinguishing ‘linguistic’ from ‘factual’ propositions was that the former are ‘rules of language’, and therefore truth-valueless, or ‘non-cognitive’. But on the Ordinary Language philosophers’ view, necessary propositions are not (disguised) assertions about the uses of words, they are ‘about’ the world just as all propositions are (and so are perfectly ‘cognitive’ bearers of truth-values). On the other hand, what makes them count as necessary, what justifies us in holding them to be so, is not any special metaphysical fact; only the ordinary empirical fact that this is how some of the propositions of language are used. (op.cit. 1940, pp. 192; 1942b) On this view, it is through linguistic practice that we establish the distinction between necessary and contingent propositions. We have met this idea already in some preliminary remarks about a use-theory of meaning (in section 2d above).

However, even on the more amenable use-based interpretation of the linguistic doctrine of necessity, metaphysicians still wish to insist that some necessities are, indeed, metaphysical, and not connected with the uses of propositions at all – for example, that nothing is both red and green all over, that a circle cannot be squared, and so forth. Thus, the objection persists that in philosophy what one is doing is inquiring into facts, that is, the nature of phenomena, the general structure and fundamental ontology of reality, and not at all the meanings of the expressions we use to describe them. Indeed, it seems to be the most prevalent and recurrent complaint against ‘linguistic’ philosophy, and it seems to be an argument in which neither side will be convinced by the other, and thus one that will probably go on indefinitely. At least one question that has not fully entered the debate is why a ‘linguistic’ problem is understood to be so philosophically inferior to a metaphysical one.

c. Ordinary Language is Correct Language

The contention ‘ordinary language is correct language’ forms the rationale, or justification, for the method of the appeal to ordinary language. This is a basic and fundamental tenet on which it is safe to say all Ordinary Language philosophers concur, more or less strongly. However, it has been often misunderstood, and the misunderstanding has unfortunately in part been attributable to the early Ordinary Language philosophers. The misunderstanding lies in conflating the notion of ‘correctness’ with the notion of ‘truth’. It appears that the Ordinary Language philosophers themselves did not always make this distinction clearly enough, nor did they always adhere to it, as we shall see below. We shall examine one formulation of the argument to the conclusion that ‘ordinary language is correct language’, and see that it need not be (as it very often has been) understood as a claim that what is said in the ordinary use of language must thereby be true (or its converse: that whatever is said in using language non-ordinarily must thereby be false).

The latter interpretation of Ordinary Language philosophy was, and is, widespread. For example, Chisholm, in 1951, devoted a paper to rejecting the claim that “Any philosophical statement which violates ordinary language is false” (pp. 175). The converse, that any statement which is in accord with ordinary language is true is a version of what came to be known as the ‘paradigm case argument’, which we shall examine in the following section.

Once again, the classic formulation of the argument to the conclusion that ‘ordinary language is correct’ is to be found in Malcolm’s 1942a paper. His argument is roughly this: not only are metaphysical philosophical disputes not based on any facts, but metaphysical claims are, generally, claims to necessary rather than ordinary, contingent truth (that is, a philosophical thesis does not claim that sometimes we cannot be certain of a material-thing statement, for that is perfectly true and we all know this; rather the philosophical thesis says that it is never the case that such statements are certain). We should note that it is at least debatable whether a metaphysical thesis might be presented as contingent (See article on Modal Illusions). Certainly for the most part, metaphysical theses are presented as necessary truths, as there are separate difficulties in doing otherwise. Malcolm’s argument is that these metaphysical theses, which contradict the ordinary uses of language, have the semantic consequence that the ordinary uses of expressions fail to express anything at all.

No metaphysician would argue for this explicitly. Indeed, most suggest that the ordinary expression they contest, or that is ultimately contested by their thesis, is ‘just wrong’, that is, merely false. The thought is that the folk get certain things wrong all the time and need to be corrected: the empirical sciences are the model here. But the analogy with science is misleading, since science only shows us that certain ways we describe things may turn out to be contingently false. But, if the metaphysically necessary propositions in question turn out to be true, that is, the ones that are inconsistent with ordinary language, the result is not that our ordinary ways of describing certain phenomena or situations turn out to be merely false. Rather, our ordinary uses of language would turn out to express that which is necessarily false – they would express, or try to express, that which is metaphysically impossible.

According to Malcolm, the implication that what is expressed in certain ordinary uses of language is necessarily false, or metaphysically impossible, renders those uses ‘self-contradictory’ (1942a, pp. 11). What he means is this: if it turns out that, say, the proposition “One never perceives a material object” is true, then because it is necessarily true, it is therefore impossible (for us) to perceive a material object. Therefore, material objects are (for us) imperceptible. So, to assert “I perceive a material object” is not merely to state a falsehood (like saying “The earth is flat”), but to state something like “I perceive something that is imperceptible.” If a metaphysical thesis is necessarily true, and it contradicts what would be said ordinarily, then the latter is necessarily false, and to assert a necessarily false proposition is to fail to assert anything at all. Failing to assert anything, in the utterance of an assertion, is to fail to use the language correctly – and this is the implicit upshot of some metaphysical theses.

On the contrary, Malcolm claims, such a misuse of language is impossible, because “The proposition that no ordinary expression is self-contradictory is a tautology” (pp. 16 – my italics). This is not to say that whatever is said using language ordinarily is thereby actually true. Malcolm insists that there are two ways one can ‘go wrong’ in saying something; one way is to be wrong about the facts, the second way is to use language incorrectly. And so he notes that it is perfectly possible to be using language correctly, and yet state something that is plainly false. But, on this view, one cannot be uttering self-contradictions and at the same time be saying something true or false for that matter. The assertion of contradictions, according to this view, has no use for us in our language (so far at least), and therefore they have no meaning (clearly, this is an aspect of the use-theory of meaning at work). On the other hand, according to Malcolm, to have a use just is to have a meaning. Thus, any expression that does have a use cannot also be ‘meaningless’ – or self-contradictory. ‘Correct’ language, therefore, is language that is or would be used, and is therefore meaningful, on this argument. Given the nature of our language, we do not, as a matter of fact, use self-contradictory expressions to describe situations (literally, sincerely and non-metaphorically that is) – although we do say such things as “It is and it is not,” but we do not say of such uses that one is contradicting oneself (see Malcolm 1942a, pp. 16 for more on uttering contradictions). He says:

The reason that no ordinary expression is self-contradictory is that a self-contradictory expression is an expression which would never be used to describe any sort of situation. It does not have a descriptive usage. An ordinary expression is an expression which would be used to describe a certain sort of situation; and since it would be used to describe a certain sort of situation, it does describe that sort of situation. A self-contradictory expression, on the contrary, describes nothing. (1942a, pp. 16)

It is on the basis of this argument that Malcolm claims that Moore, in the imagined dispute with Russell, actually refutes the philosophical propositions in question - merely by pointing out that they do ‘go against ordinary language’ (1942a, pp. 5). It is here that we get some insight into why it was assumed that Ordinary Language philosophy argued that anything said in the non-ordinary use of language must be false (and anything said in ordinary language must be true): Malcolm after all does say that what Moore says refutes the skeptical claims and shows the falsity of the proposition in question.

However, it must be kept in mind that what Malcolm is claiming to be true and false here are the linguistic versions of the dispute: he claims that Moore’s assertion that “It is a correct use of language to say that ‘I am certain this is a desk before me’” is true – he does not argue that Moore has proven there is a desk before him. Moreover, the philosophical proposition Moore has proven to be false is not “No material-thing statement is known for certain,” but the claim that “It is not a correct use of language to say ‘I am certain this is a desk before me’.” What Malcolm has argued, even if he himself did not make this entirely clear (and perhaps even deliberately equivocated on), is that certain claims about what is a correct (ordinary) use of language are true or false. His is not an argument with metaphysical results, and he has not shown, through Moore, that any version of skepticism is false. Indeed, the metaphysical thesis itself is beside the point. If the skeptic insists that, although it may be an incorrect use of language to say “I am not certain that this is a desk before me,” it may nevertheless be true, then the onus is on the skeptic to explain why it is that our ordinary claims to ‘know’ such and such are, therefore, not merely contingently false, but necessarily false. By Malcolm’s lights, this would amount to the skeptic claiming that this particular part of our use of language, that is, that involving some ordinary claims to ‘know’ such and such, is self-contradictory; yet, for Malcolm, as we have seen, this is not possible, because ordinary language is correct language. At any rate, in assessing the Ordinary Language argument, it is clear that the claim that philosophical propositions are incorrect uses of language and the claim that what they express is false ought not be conflated.

Although Malcolm has not refuted the skeptic, he nevertheless has demonstrated that there are some semantic difficulties in formulating the skeptical thesis in the first place – since it requires the non-ordinary use of language. This places additional, hitherto unacknowledged constraints on certain skeptical and metaphysical theses. Either the skeptic/metaphysician must acknowledge the non-ordinary use of the expression in question, or she must argue that we must reform our ordinary use. In the first case, she must then acknowledge that her thesis concerns something other than what we are ordinarily talking about when we use the term in question (for example ‘know’, ‘perceive’, ‘certain’, and so forth). In the second case, she must convince us that our ordinary use of the expression has, hitherto unbeknownst to us, been a misuse of language: we have, up till now, been asserting something that is necessarily false. Someone, in the imagined philosophical dispute, is failing to use language correctly, or failing to express anything in their description of some phenomenon. The dilemma the skeptic faces is that neither of theses two possibilities is a comfortable one for her to explain, although maintaining the truth of her thesis. This dilemma creates a situation for the skeptic that, although not refuting her directly, poses a possibly insurmountable challenge to meaningfully formulating her thesis.

d. The Paradigm Case Argument

The so-called ‘paradigm-case argument’ generated a good deal of debate (for example Watkins 1957; Richman 1961; Flew 1966; Hanfling 1990). It plays a significant role in Ordinary Language philosophy, because it tends to be interpreted as the mistaken view that Ordinary Language philosophy contends that what is said in ordinary language must be true. This is a prime example, as will be shown, of conflating the claim that ordinary language is correct with the claim that what is expressed in the ordinary use of some expression is true.

It was understood that the paradigm-case argument was an argument that shows that there must be (at least some) true instances, in the actual and not merely possible world, of anything that is said (referred to) in ordinary language. For example, Roderick Chisholm (1951) says “There are words in ordinary language, Malcolm believes, whose use implies that they have a denotation. That is to say, from the fact that they are used in ordinary language, we may infer that there is something to which they truly apply” (pp. 180). On this interpretation, certain metaphysical truths, indeed empirical truths, could be proven simply by the fact that we use a certain expression ordinarily. This seems clearly an absurd position to take, and does not, once again, appear to be supported by the texts.

Malcolm invokes what is now known as the paradigm-case argument by reference to one of the outcomes on the assumption that the philosophical claims he is examining are true. If we consider, say, the thesis that “No-one ever knows for certain the truth of any material-thing statement” to be true, then on that theory it turns out that an ordinary expression such as “I am certain there is a chair in this room” is never true, no matter how good our evidence for the claim is – indeed, regardless of the evidence. Malcolm casts the ‘Moorean’ reply to such a view, that “[On the contrary] both of us know for certain there are several chairs in this room, and how absurd it would be to suggest that we do not know it, but only believe it, or that it is highly probable but not really certain!” (1942a, pp. 12) Malcolm says,

What [Moore’s] reply does is give us a paradigm of absolute certainty, just as in the case previously discussed his reply gave us a paradigm of seeing something not a part of one’s brain. What his reply does is to appeal to our language-sense; to make us feel how queer and wrong it would be to say, when we sat in a room seeing and touching chairs, that we believed there were chairs but did not know it for certain, or that it was only highly probable that there were chairs… Moore’s refutation consists simply in pointing out that [the expression “know for certain”] has an application to empirical statements. (1942a, pp. 13)

Here, he says nothing to the effect that Moore has proven that it is true that there are in fact chairs and tables before us, and so forth. All Malcolm has claimed is that Moore has denied, indeed disproven, the suggestion that the term ‘certainty’ has no application to empirical statements. He has disproven that by invoking examples where it is manifestly the case that the term ‘certainty’ has been, and can be, ‘applied’. Nothing, notice, has been said as to whether there really are tables, chairs and cheese before us - unless, that is, we confuse ‘having an application’ with ‘having a reference’ or ‘having a true application’. But it is not necessary to interpret the claims this way. ‘Having an application’ means, as Malcolm argues, having a use in a given situation. Malcolm’s example in the quote above is a ‘paradigm of absolute certainty’, but not, notice, a proof of what it is that one is certain of. It is a ‘paradigm of absolute certainty’ because it is a prime example of the sort of situation, or context in which the term ‘certain’ applies – it is a paradigm of the term’s use: namely, in situations where we have very good (though not infallible) evidence, and no reason to think that our evidence is not of the highest quality. Indeed, on Malcolm’s view, a ‘paradigm case’ is an example of the ordinary use and hence the ordinary meaning of an expression.

The point of appealing to paradigm cases, then, is not to guarantee the truth of ordinary expressions, but to demonstrate that they have a use in the language. Thus, the paradigm-case argument is an effective move against any view that implies that some ordinary expression does not have a use, or application – for example that what we call ‘certain’ (well-evidenced non-mathematical statements) are not ‘really’ certain. That the ordinary use of expressions should be incorrect is, on Malcolm’s argument, as impossible as it would be for the rules of chess to be incorrect (and therefore that what we play is not ‘really’ chess).

e. A Use-Theory of Linguistic Meaning

The ‘use-theory’ of meaning, whose source is Wittgenstein and which was adopted by the Ordinary Language philosophers, objects to the idea that language could be treated like a calculus, or an ‘ideal language’. If language is like a calculus, then its ‘meanings’ could be specified, so that determinate truth-conditions could be paired with every expression of a language in advance of, and independently of, any particular use of a term or expression in a speech-act. Therefore, the observation of our actual uses of expressions in the huge variety of contexts and speech-acts we do and can use them in would be irrelevant to determining the meaning of expressions. On the contrary, for the Ordinary Language Philosopher, linguistic meaning may only be determined by the observation of the various uses of expressions in their actual ordinary uses, and it is not independent of these. Thus, Wittgenstein claimed that:

For a large class of cases – though not for all – in which we employ the word “meaning” it can be defined thus: the meaning of a word is its use in the language. (Section 43)

Does this mean that only sometimes ‘meaning is use’? The remark has been interpreted this way (for example Lycan 1999, pp. 99, fn 2). But it need not be. We need to notice that in the remark, Wittgenstein refers to ‘cases where we employ the word “meaning,”’ and not ‘cases of meaning’. The difference, it might be said, is that sometimes when we use the term ‘meaning’ we are not talking about linguistic meaning. That is, we may talk about for example “The meaning of her phone call,” in which case we are not going to be assisted by looking to the use of the word ‘phone call’ in the language. On the other hand, when we use the word ‘meaning’ as in “The meaning of ‘broiling’ is (such and such),” then looking to the use of the word ‘broiling’ in the language will help. Thus, an interpretation is possible in which the remark does not mean that only sometimes ‘meaning is use’. Rather, we can interpret it as claiming that linguistic meaning is to be found in language use.

At the most fundamental base of a use-theory, language is not representational - although it is sometimes (perhaps even almost always) used to represent. On the view, the ‘meaning’ of a term (or expression) is exhausted by its use: there is nothing further, nothing ‘over and above’, the use of an expression for its meaning to be.

A good many objections have been raised to this theory, which we cannot here examine in full. However, most appear to object to it because it apparently rules out the possibility of a systematic theory of meaning. If meaning-is-use, then the ideal language approach is out of the question, and determining linguistic meaning becomes an ad-hoc process. This thought has displeased many, as they have understood it to entail something of an end to the possibility of a philosophy of language per se. Dummett (1973), for example, has complained that:

…[although] the ‘philosophy of ordinary language’ was indeed a species of linguistic philosophy, [it was] one which was contrary to the spirit of Frege in two fundamental ways, namely in its dogmatic denial of the possibility of system, and in its treatment of natural language as immune from criticism. (pp. 683)

Soames (2003) goes on to echo the same complaint:

Rather than constructing general theories of meaning, philosophers were supposed to attend to subtle aspects of language use, and to show how misuse of certain words leads to philosophical perplexity and confusion. [Such a view] proved to be unstable… What is needed is some sort of systematic theory of what meaning is, and how it interacts with these other factors governing the use of language. (pp. xiv)

It was ultimately the re-introduction of the possibility of a systematic theory of meaning by Grice, later at Oxford (see section 5, below), that finally spelled the end for Ordinary Language philosophy.

4. Oxford

By the 1940s, the views of the later Wittgenstein, and the Wittgensteinians, had penetrated Oxford. There, philosophers took up the ideas of Wittgenstein, but they were much more critical and much more interested in developing their own views. The move now was to apply the principles to be found in Wittgenstein, and to show how they could actually contribute significantly to philosophy – rather than merely make philosophical problems ‘disappear’. ‘Oxford’ philosophy was still ‘linguistic’, but much less dogmatically so, much more flexible in its approach, much less interested in metaphilosophical justification for their views and rather more interested in applying their views to real, current, philosophical problems. The Oxford philosophers no longer treated all philosophical problems as mere ‘pseudo-problems’, nor even all of them as ‘linguistic’. But nevertheless they retained the view that philosophical uses of language can be a source of philosophical confusions and that the observation and study of ordinary language would help to resolve them. What was new, regarding Ordinary Language philosophy, was the rejection of Wittgenstein’s idea that there could be no proper ‘philosophical’ knowledge.

Austin famously remarked:

Certainly ordinary language has no claim to be the last word, if there is such a thing. It embodies, indeed, something better than the metaphysics of the Stone Age, namely… the inherited experience and acumen of many generations of men. But then, that acumen has been concentrated primarily upon the practical business of life. If a distinction works well for practical purposes in ordinary life (no mean feat, for even ordinary life is full of hard cases), it will not mark nothing: yet this is likely enough to be not the best way of arranging things if our interests are more extensive or intellectual than the ordinary… Certainly, then, ordinary language is not the last word: in principle it can everywhere be supplemented and improved upon and superseded. Only remember, it is the first word. (And forget, for once and for a while, that other curious question “Is it true?” May we?) (1956, pp. 185 and fn 2 in parentheses)

a. Ryle

Ryle emerged at Oxford as one of the most important figures in early 20th century analytic philosophy. Ryle, indeed, became a champion of ‘ordinary language’, writing, in his early career, a number of papers dealing with such issues as what counts as ‘ordinary’ language, what are the nature of ‘meanings’, and how the appeal to ordinary ways of describing things can help resolve philosophical problems (including his 1931, 1953, 1957, 1961). In particular, Ryle became famous for his treatment of mental phenomena in his Concept of Mind (1949). The book contains, overall, a ‘behaviorist’ analysis of mental phenomena that draws heavily on Wittgensteinian anti-Cartesianism – or anti-dualism (of ‘mind’ and ‘body’). On this view, the mind is not a kind of ‘gaseous’ but non-spatial, non-physical medium of thoughts, nor is it a kind of ‘theatre’ via which we observe our own experiences and sensations. Our mental life is not, according to Ryle, a private domain to which each individual has exclusive access. Our psychological language expresses our thoughts; it does not describe what is going on in the mind in the same way that physical language describes what is going on in the body, according to Ryle in this period.

The ‘Cartesian Myth’ of the mind – what Ryle calls the “Dogma of the Ghost in the Machine” (1949, pp. 15) – is perpetuated, according to Ryle, because philosophers commit what he calls a ‘category mistake’ in applying the language of the physical world to the psychological world (for example, talking about ‘events’ and ‘causes’ in the mind as we would talk of such things in the body). Contrary to this ‘myth’, according to Ryle, our access to our own thoughts and feelings are not, like our access to those of others, something we observe about ourselves (by looking ‘inward’ as opposed to ‘outward’). We do not observe our thoughts; we think them. What we call ‘beliefs’, ‘thoughts’, ‘knowledge’, ‘feelings’, and so forth are not special kinds of ‘occult’ objects ‘inside’ the mind. As regards ‘other minds’, psychological phenomena are available publicly in certain behaviors (which are not mere ‘signs’ of what is going on internally in others, but partially what constitutes what it is to attribute such things, for example, as ‘believing X’, ‘thinking about Y’, and so forth). Ryle arrives at these views through the analysis of the ordinary uses of psychological expressions, remarking:

I am not, for example, denying that there occur mental processes. Doing long division is a mental process and so is making a joke. But I am saying that the phrase ‘there occur mental processes’ does not mean the same thing as ‘there occur physical processes’, and, therefore it makes no sense to conjoin or disjoin the two. (1949, pp. 22)

The view Ryle promotes is that the expressions we use in attributing psychological states and the expressions we use in attributing physical states have quite distinct uses, and that when we see this aright, we see that it does not make sense to conflate them in claims such as ‘an intention in her mind caused her arm to rise’ (the sort of things one might expect on the ‘Ghost in the Machine’ theory). In everyday life, we know perfectly well, for example, what the criteria are in virtue of which we count a person as, for example, thinking, calculating, having raised an arm intentionally, and so forth. Puzzlement only arises, according to Ryle, when philosophers try to account for mental phenomena according to the ‘logic’ of the category of physical phenomena, for example, talking about the mystery of ‘mental causation’.

By highlighting the ordinary use of mental-phenomena expressions, and the ways in which we ordinarily ascribe them to people (for example, “She is thinking about home,” “I wish I had a cup-cake,” “He is adding up the bill,” and so on), Ryle shows that the philosophical problem of how mental phenomena can interact with physical phenomena is poorly formulated. The manner in which psychological terms are used in such philosophical problems, theories, and so forth, are not the same ways the terms are used in ordinary discourse. Using the terms in this way leads philosophers to conclude either that some form of dualism of mind and body or some form of physicalism is true (see Mental Causation for more on the traditional theories of mind). But observing our ordinary uses of psychological terms shows, Ryle argues, that as we mean them to describe ourselves and one another (and sometimes even when we apply psychological terms to non-people), mental phenomena need not be understood as ‘internal’ events that we observe, nor as reducible, in some sense, to mere brain-states.

b. Austin

Austin, at Oxford, first took up the issue of the so-called ‘sense-data’ theory, originally formulated by Russell (as we saw above). His Sense and Sensibilia (1962) (a pun on Jane Austen’s Sense and Sensibility) is a classic of ordinary language analysis. It contrasts the ordinary uses of the words ‘looks’, ‘seems’, ‘appears’ ‘perceives’, and so forth to the ways they are used in support of the sense-data theory. The argument for sense-data is, partially, based on the view that we are unable to distinguish between veridical experience and illusion. Therefore, the reasoning goes, all we can be sure of is what is common to both experiences, which is the ‘seeming to be such and such’ or sense-data. So, on the view, because it is possible that any experience may be an illusion, the only thing that is certain is the sense-data before the mind. Of this theory Austin says:

My general opinion about this doctrine is that it is a typically scholastic view, attributable…to an obsession with a few particular words, the uses of which are over-simplified, not really understood or carefully studied or correctly described…The fact is, as I shall try to make clear, that our ordinary words are much subtler in their uses, and mark many more distinctions, than philosophers have realized; and that the facts of perception…are much more diverse and complicated than has been allowed for. (1962, pp. 3)

Austin points out, amongst other things, that, as a matter of fact we do know the difference between a veridical and an illusory experience, and we speak of such experiences differently – the distinction between ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ has an established, and ordinary, use in language. For example, a stick placed in a glass of water appears to be bent, but we have criteria for describing the difference between this bent stick and a stick which is bent outside the glass. We say, “the stick looks bent” in the water, but we say, “the stick is bent” of the other. The availability of ways in language to mark the distinction between illusions and veridical experiences demonstrates, according to Austin, that the sense-data argument is invalid - because those terms, which have ordinary uses in language, are misused in the sense-data theory. For example, if the sense-data theory is true, then we are marking nothing in our experience when we distinguish between ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ experiences – those expressions have no real meaning (we are failing to express anything in their utterance). The same would follow, if the sense-data theory were correct, that our ordinary uses of cognate terms such as ‘appearing’, ‘looking’, ‘seeming’, and so forth, and also ‘finding out that X was not as it appeared to be’ have no application – since there would be no ‘real’ distinction, for us, between how things appear and how they really are. This conclusion, from which it follows that we should withdraw the terms ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ from use in language, is absurd – the distinction is marked in language and therefore exists (for example, between the way things ‘look’ and the way things ‘are’ – though we are not always infallible in our judgments). The question whether or not the distinction corresponds with a metaphysical reality (“But do sticks really exist,” and so forth), is a question about some other distinction – not the distinction we draw, in ordinary use, between ‘appears to be’ and ‘is’. And so, by attending to the ordinary uses of terms such as ‘veridical’ and ‘illusory’ and their cognates, Austin shows that the philosophical use of them in formulating the sense-data thesis is based on a misconstrual of their ordinary meanings.

Austin became a master of the observation of the uses of language. He noted nuanced differences in the ways words very close in meaning are used that many others missed. He showed that, even in its most ordinary uses, language is indeed a much finer, sensitive and precise instrument than had previously been acknowledged. Such observations belie the view that ordinary language is somehow deficient for the purposes of describing reality. Austin demonstrated, through his explorations, the flexibility of language, how subtle variations in meaning were possible, how delicate, sometimes, is the choice of a word for saying what one wants or needs to say. He called his method ‘linguistic phenomenology’ (1956, pp. 182). What his demonstrations of the fineness of grain of meaning, in very concrete and particular examples, showed was that philosophical uses of language take expressions out of their ordinary working environment, that is, everyday communicative discourse. Wittgenstein described this as ‘language going on holiday’ (1953, section 38). Such philosophical uses, Austin showed, treat expressions as rigid, one-dimensional, rather blunt instruments, with far less descriptive power than ordinary language: thus contradicting the view that the philosophical uses of language are more ‘accurate’ and ‘precise’.

Austin is also well known for his original work on what is now known as ‘speech-act’ theory, in his How to Do Things with Words (based on his William James Lectures delivered at Harvard in 1955, published as a monograph in 1962). Key to Austin’s achievement here was his development of the idea that the utterances of sentences in the use of language are not all of the same kind: not all utterances represent some aspect of the world (for example, not all utterances are assertions). Some, perhaps many, utterances involve executing actions. Austin’s example is the making of a promise. To utter “I promise to pay you back” is, on Austin’s analysis, to perform an act, that is to say, the very act of promising is carried out in uttering the sentence, rather than the sentence describing a state of affairs (that is, oneself in the state of promising). Austin developed an extensive taxonomy of the uses of language, establishing firmly the notion that language goes beyond simple representation, and has social and pragmatic dimensions that must be taken into account by any adequate theory of linguistic meaning.

c. Strawson

Strawson, who was a pupil of Grice, developed in his mature work a Kantian thesis aiming to uncover the most fundamental categories of thought. This project, which Strawson called a ‘descriptive metaphysics’, was to investigate what he called our ‘fundamental conceptual structure’. Strawson understood the philosophical project to require more than the appeal to ordinary language. He said,

Up to a point, the reliance upon a close examination of the actual use of words is the best, and indeed the only sure, way in philosophy. But the discriminations we can make, and the connexions we can establish, in this way are not general enough and not far-reaching enough to meet the full metaphysical demand for understanding. For when we ask how we use this or that expression, our answers, however revealing at a certain level, are apt to assume, and not to expose, those general elements of the structure that the metaphysician wants revealed. (1959, pp. 9-10)

The investigation of our conceptual structure had to involve more than the observation of our ordinary uses of language (which only assume that structure), but, nevertheless, the project, via transcendental argument, remained one of description of our ordinary ways of experiencing the world. Strawson’s view, contrary to the Wittgensteinian doctrine that philosophy is no more than descriptive of what is open to view to anyone, was that descriptive metaphysics involved the acquisition of genuinely new philosophical knowledge, and not merely the resolution of philosophical confusion. In this project, however, Strawson did not stray altogether too far from the Ordinary Language philosophical commitments (compare Strawson 1962, pp. 320), and his ‘linguistic’ philosophical credentials remained sound. Nevertheless, he believed that there was a deeper metaphysical reality concerning our conceptual structure that needed uncovering via a ‘descriptive metaphysics’. Strawson influenced the shift in philosophical interest from language to concepts – but the methodology and metaphilosophical rationale remained the same: the view that there is no route to a ‘metaphysical reality’ that is independent of our experience of it. Our experience of reality is, on this view, mediated by our particular conceptual structure, and a careful description of our ordinary experience – through the appeal to ordinary language – will help us to understand the nature of the conceptual structure.

Earlier in his career, Strawson criticized Russell’s revered Theory of Descriptions in his 1950 paper ‘On Referring’. Here Strawson objected that Russell failed to take into account the fact that not all uses of sentences make either true or false statements. If we distinguish ‘sentences’ and ‘statements’, indeed, we shall see that sentences are not always used to make statements. Sentences have many and varied uses, but are not, in and of themselves, true or false; what they are used to say may well be true or false (but there are also other uses than statement-making). Strawson argued that Russell had conflated meaning with, roughly, a truth-condition (or a reference). He said, on the contrary, that,

… the question whether a sentence or expression is significant or not has nothing whatever to do with the question of whether the sentence, uttered on a particular occasion, is, on that occasion, being used to make a true-or-false assertion or not, or of whether the expression is, on that occasion, being used to refer to, or mention, anything at all… the fact that [a sentence] is significant is the same as the fact that it can be correctly used to talk about something and that, in so using it, someone will be making a true or false assertion. (1950, pp. 172-173)

This position presaged a much more contemporary debate between those who hold that the meaning of a sentence remains invariant over contexts of use, and those who hold the contrary (see below, section 6).

In 1956, Strawson and his teacher, H. P. Grice, together published a paper that attacked Quine’s repudiation of the so-called ‘analytic-synthetic’ distinction. The repudiation is based on the idea that because the distinction has a use in the language, certainly in philosophy - but it is a distinction that is also marked outside of philosophy - then it has an inviolable place in language. They say, “…‘analytic’ and ‘synthetic’ have a more or less established [philosophical and ordinary] use; and this seems to suggest that it is absurd, even senseless, to say there is no such distinction” (1956, pp. 43). This is a classic example of the so-called ‘paradigm-case argument’. When Quine denies the analytic-synthetic distinction, it is to suggest that the distinction has no application. But that suggestion is demonstrably false, since we do apply the distinction (or more prosaic cognates of ‘analytic’, for example, ‘synonymous’ or ‘means the same as’, and so forth). Whether or not there is a metaphysical reality to which this distinction corresponds is quite superfluous to the reality that it is a distinction that has a use in the language, and its use alone justifies its being a perfectly meaningful one to make (1956, pp. 143).

5. The Demise of Ordinary Language Philosophy: Grice

It was ultimately Grice who came to introduce, at Oxford, some of the first ideas that marked the significant fall from grace of Ordinary Language philosophy. Other factors combined to contribute to the general demise of Ordinary Language philosophy, in particular the rise in popularity of formal semantics, but also a renewed pursuit of ‘naturalism’ in philosophy, aimed at drawing the discipline nearer, once again, to the sciences. In this climate, aspects of the ‘ideal language’ view emerged as dominant, mostly manifesting in a commitment to a truth-conditional view of meaning in the philosophy of language. Grice had a special place in this story because his work, as well as providing the argument which threw Ordinary Language philosophical principles into doubt, contributed to the development of a field of study that ultimately became the wellspring of those carrying on the legacy of the Ordinary Language philosophers in the 21st century; namely speech-act theory.

Grice’s version of ‘speech-act theory’ (see also section 4c of Philosophy of Language) included an ‘intention-based’ theory of communication. The basic principle of speech-act theory (as Austin, and Grice following him, developed it) is that language is not merely a system of symbols that represent things – the process of communication is a result of interaction between agents, and the pragmatic aspects of communication must be factored into any account of linguistic meaning. As Austin emphasized, language use is, in part, the performance of actions, as well as the representation of the world. In particular, for Grice, part of what matters, for a theory of language, is what the agent intends to communicate. One of the most important concepts introduced by Grice is that of conversational implicature (see the chapter entitled ‘Logic and Conversation’ in his 1989). The notion of conversational implicature suggests that part of what is communicated, in conversation, is communicated pragmatically rather than semantically. For example, take the following sentences:

(a) He took out his key and opened the door.

(b) Jones got married and had children.

(c) (looking in the refrigerator) “There is no beer.”

We might understand (a) to imply that he opened the door with the key he took out. But, the words alone do not strictly say this. Similarly, in (b), we might understand that Jones got married and had children in that order, and such that the two events are connected in the relevant way, and in (c), we generally understand the claim to be about the lack of beer in the fridge, not in the universe. In all of these examples, according to Grice, information is communicated, not by the semantics of the sentences alone, but by the pragmatic process he calls conversational implicature. (For more detail on Grice’s taxonomy of pragmatic processes, and also his views about the ‘maxims of conversation’, see Grice 1989.)

Pragmatic aspects of communication, according to Grice, must be distinguished from the strictly semantic aspects, and thus, according to him, meaning must not be confused with use. But this, on his view, is precisely what the Ordinary Language philosophers do, insofar as their ‘appeal to ordinary language’ is based on the view that meaning is determined by use (see the chapter entitled ‘Prolegomena’ in his 1989). Indeed, Grice here launches a detailed attack on many of the ‘ordinary language’ analyses put forward by, amongst others, Wittgenstein, Ryle, Austin, Malcolm and Strawson. In each case, Grice argues that where the Ordinary Language philosopher appeals to the use of the expression, especially in order to throw doubt on some other philosophical theory, what occurs is the failure to distinguish meaning (that is, ‘semantic content’ or ‘truth-conditions’) and use (that is, pragmatic aspects of communication such as implicature). Therefore, the argument that philosophical non-ordinary uses of expressions are a problem for metaphysical theses is itself at fault. (It should be noted that, this view notwithstanding, Grice remained more or less in agreement with the general view that ‘ordinary language is correct’ - compare Grice, the chapter entitled ‘Postwar Oxford Philosophy’ in his 1989.)

The general criticism, from Grice, is that the arguments of the Ordinary Language philosophers cannot be run on the basic semantics of expressions – they can apply only to the uses particular expressions are put to in specific examples. This complaint touches on the actual claims Ordinary Language philosophers have made about the use and meaning of certain expressions – in particular, claims as to when it would or would not ‘make sense’ to say “X,” or to use “X” in a certain way. To recall an example we are now familiar with - the term ‘know’ - Grice argued that, for example, when Malcolm contended that the skeptical use of ‘know’ is a misuse of that term, that this claim shows nothing relevant about the meaning of the term or the expressions in which it features. The oddness, for example, of applying the term ‘know’ in certain ways, for example, in “I feel pain, but I do not know for sure” is generated by the pragmatic features of that particular use, and is independent of the strictly semantic features.

Grice’s argument about distinguishing meaning and use appeals to the notion of the existence of an independent semantics of a language – that is, the idea that the expressions of a language have meanings which are both independent of, and invariant over, the wide variety of uses those expressions might figure in. Thus, on this view, a ‘philosophical’ and an ‘ordinary’ use of some expression do not differ in meaning – contrary to the claim of Ordinary Language philosophy. Thus, for example, an expression has an invariant semantic content even though, in its use, it may have a variety of conversational implicatures. However, the latter, on this view, are not part of the ‘meaning’ proper. Thus, observations about variations in the use of some expression will tell us nothing about its meaning.

The upshot of this argument is that the so-called ‘paradoxical’ statements attributed to classical metaphysical philosophy by the Ordinary Language philosophers may not be so paradoxical after all. Moreover, and perhaps more significantly, what this view made possible once again was the pursuit of a systematic theory of language. Use-theories could not, on the received view, be ‘systematic’ in the way required (broadly: computational). Indeed, Grice remarked, “My primary aim is… to determine how any such distinction between meaning and use is to be drawn, and where lie the limits of its philosophical utility. Any serious attempt to achieve this aim will, I think, involve a search for a systematic theory of language…” (1989, pp. 4).

The view that there ought to be possible a ‘systematic’ theory of language gained considerable ground on the passport given it by Grice. That is, if the distinction between meaning and use is correct, then a good deal of the linguistic phenomena pointed out by the Ordinary Language philosophers, and which was supposed to have ramifications for the meaning, and therefore correct use, of expressions can now be fully accounted for by a variety of ‘pragmatic’ aspects of communication. Therefore, the core, classical semantic theory for a language could continue to be pursued more or less independently of issues connected with language use; and pragmatics can generally be called upon to account for any linguistic phenomena that semantics cannot.

Of course, this argument depends on the ability of the Gricean to sufficiently identify something like the ‘literal meaning’ of a sentence (that which is to be designated the ‘semantic’ rather than the ‘pragmatic’ content of a speech-act); and in which it may occur independently of any particular conversational implicatures it is used to convey, on an occasion of use. Isolating such a literal, invariant meaning has, however, proven difficult. For example, Charles Travis (1996; 1999) has pointed out, a variety of ways that a sentence may be used quite literally, non-metaphorically, seriously and sincerely – and yet still express two distinct propositions, that is, have two distinct truth-conditions and thus fail to have an invariant semantic content. A classic ‘Travis-style’ example is a sentence such as “Pass me the red book.” Such a sentence could be used, quite literally, non-metaphorically, and so forth, to request someone to pass the book that has a red cover, and it can be used to request someone to pass the book which has only a red spine. What counts as ‘red’ in these cases is different: that is, a thing can be completely, or only partially, red to count in certain contexts. This difference in what is expressed cannot be classified as conversational implicature, so both propositions are properly semantically expressed. But Grice’s distinction is supposed to show how to isolate one semantic content, or proposition, or truth-condition per sentence. Hence the Gricean has a problem in accounting for a semantic-pragmatic distinction in the content of speech-acts – a distinction that is required for the argument against Ordinary Language philosophy to work

6. Contemporary Views

The remainder of the 20th century saw the rise of the general ‘ideal language’ approach, including a commitment to versions of truth-conditional theories of meaning, to a position of dominance. However, in recent years (the early 21st century), there has been something of a renaissance of the ideas originating in Ordinary Language philosophy. François Recanati (2004) remarked that,

Despite [that] early antagonism… semantics (the formal study of meaning and truth-conditions) and pragmatics (the study of language in use) are now conceived of as complementary disciplines, shedding light on different aspects of language… Instructed by Grice they systematically draw a distinction between what a given expression means, and what its use means or conveys in a particular context (or even in general). (pp. 2-3)

However, this appearance of co-operative reconciliation – that at least some kind of semantics-pragmatics interaction will provide a complete theory of language – is to a certain extent merely a façade of orthodoxy, which obscures somewhat more radical underlying views. A spectrum of positions now runs between radical extremes of how much of what we want to call ‘meaning’ is determined by semantics, and how much by pragmatics. The argument can roughly be described as a difference as to the degree of independence (from pragmatics) that we can ascribe to linguistic meaning. Some are of the view that at least a core of semantic content remains untouched by pragmatic effects. Others hold that all semantic content is ‘pragmatically saturated’. These positions carry on the legacies of Ideal and Ordinary Language philosophies respectively – now known as variations on ‘Literalism’ and ‘Contextualism’. (See Recanati 2004 for a clarifying description of the various views that now compose the debate.) The former position has also pitched itself as a semantic ‘minimalism’ or ‘invariantism’ (compare Cappelen and Lepore 2005; Borg 2004). Contextualism, the view that has its origins in Ordinary Language philosophy, has support from, for example, Recanati (2004) and Travis (who argues for the ‘occasion-sensitivity’ of meaning, see his 1996). Supporters of the notion of the context (or use)-sensitivity of meaning object to Grice’s original argument: that we really can cleave a distinctly semantic content from all other aspects of language use. Contextualists argue that it is difficult, perhaps impossible, to isolate a purely semantic core, untouched by pragmatic influences, for example a ‘literal’ meaning (compare Searle 1979; Recanati 2004).

Nevertheless, there have been highly successful efforts at devising theories which treat of many of the phenomena assumed to be pragmatic, but which nevertheless have been shown to have inextricably semantic effects. Examples of such phenomena include, for example, indexicality, quantifier domain restriction, seemingly relative or ‘scalar’ terms such as ‘tall’, ‘rich’ and so on. The theories in question aim at showing that such phenomena are after all perfectly formalizable aspects of a classical semantic account, and not merely pragmatic effects on meaning (a classic example of such work is to be found in Stanley and Gendler Szabo 2000 and King and Stanley 2005). Along these lines, the philosophy of language is well on its way (again) toward being based on a ‘systematic’ theory of meaning. Nevertheless, the ‘Homeric struggle’ Strawson described (2004, pp. 132) between two fundamentally opposing views about linguistic meaning continues.


7. References and Further Reading

a. Analysis and Formal Logic

  • Beaney, Michael. (Ed.). 1997. The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Dummett, Michael. 1981 [1973]. Frege: Philosophy of Language. London: Duckworth.
  • Dummett, Michael. 1997 [1993]. The Seas of Language. London: Oxford University Press.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1879]. “Begriffsschrift: Selections (Preface and Part I).” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 47-78.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1918]. “Thought.” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 325-345.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1891]. “Function and Concept.” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 130-148.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1997 [1892]. “On Sinn and Bedeutung.” In M. Beaney, ed., The Frege Reader. Oxford: Blackwell, 151-171.
  • Ramsey, Frank P. 1959 [1931]. “Philosophy.” In A. J. Ayer, ed., Logical Positivism. New York: The Free Press, 321-326.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1949 [1905]. “On Denoting.” In H. Feigl and W. Sellars, eds., Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 103-119.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1910. “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 11, 108-128.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1914. Our Knowledge of the External World. La Salle: Open Court.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1995 [1921]. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, trans., D. F. Pears. London: Routledge.

b. Logical Atomism

  • Ayer, Alfred Jules. 1940. The Foundations of Empirical Knowledge. London: Macmillan.
  • Pears, David. 1972. Russell’s Logical Atomism. Illinois: Fontana Press.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1918-1919. “The Philosophy of Logical Atomism.” The Monist 28, 495-527; 29, 32-63, 190-222, 345-380.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1959 [1924]. “Logical Atomism.” In A. J. Ayer, ed., Logical Positivism. New York: The Free Press, 31-50.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1927. The Analysis of Matter. London: George Allen and Unwin.

c. Logical Positivism and Ideal Language

  • Ayer, Alfred Jules. (Ed.). 1959. Logical Positivism. New York: The Free Press.
    • A collection of seminal papers in Logical Positivism.
  • Bergmann, Gustav. 1992 [1953]. “Logical Positivism, Language, and the Reconstruction of Metaphysics.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 63-71.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1949. Truth and confirmation. In H. Feigl and W. Sellars, eds., Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 119-127.
    • Discusses the Ideal/Ordinary Language philosophical differences in detail.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1992 [1934]. “On the Character of Philosophic Problems.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 54-62.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1937. The Logical Syntax of Language, trans., A. Smeaton. London: Routledge.
  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1992 [1950]. “Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 72-84.
  • Coffa, J. Alberto. 1991. The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Feigl, Herbert and Sellars, Wilfrid. (Eds.). 1949. Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts.
    • A collection of early papers in Logical Positivism.
  • Feigl, Herbert. 1949 [1943]. “Logical Empiricism.” In H. Feigl and W. Sellars, eds., Readings in Philosophical Analysis. New York: Appleton-Century-Crofts, 3-26.
  • Rorty, Richard. 1992 [1967]. “Introduction.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1-39.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur. 1997 [1963]. The Philosophy of Rudolf Carnap. LaSalle: Open Court.
  • Schlick, Moritz. 1992 [1932]. “The Future of Philosophy.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 43-53.

d. Early Ordinary Language Philosophy

  • Ambrose, Alice. 1950. “The Problem of Linguistic Inadequacy.” In M. Black, ed., Philosophical Analysis. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 15-37.
  • Ambrose, Alice and Lazerowitz, Morris. 1985. Necessity and Language. London: Croom Helm.
  • Black, Max. (Ed.). 1950. Philosophical Analysis. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall.
  • Black, Max. (Ed.). 1954. Problems of Analysis. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Chappell, Vere Claiborne. (Ed.). 1964. Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall.
    • Basic collection of essential Ordinary Language philosophical classics.
  • Caton, Charles Edwin. (Ed.). 1963. Philosophy and Ordinary Language. Urbana: University of Illinois Press.
  • Farrell, Brian. (1946a). An appraisal of therapeutic positivism I. Mind 55, 25-48.
  • Farrell, Brian. (1946b). An appraisal of therapeutic positivism II. Mind 55, 133-150.
  • Flew, Antony. (Ed.). 1951. Logic and Language. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Flew, Antony. (Ed.). 1953. Logic and Language, 2nd Series. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Flew, Antony. (Ed.). 1956. Essays in Conceptual Analysis. London: Macmillan.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1964 [1942a]. “Moore and Ordinary Language.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 5-23.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1942b. “Certainty and Empirical Statements.” Mind 52, 18-36.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1940. “Are Necessary Propositions Really Verbal?” Mind 69, 189-203.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1949. “Defending Common Sense.” Philosophical Review 58, 201- 220.
  • Malcolm, Norman. 1951. “Philosophy for Philosophers.” Philosophical Review 60, 329-340.
  • Rorty, Richard. (Ed.). 1992 [1967]. The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
    • A unique and seminal collection of essays on both the Ordinary Language and the Ideal Language views. Rorty’s introductions are well worth reading for their insightful comments on the issues involved. Has an enormous and comprehensive cross-referenced bibliography on the literature.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1992 [1931]. “Systematically Misleading Expressions.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 85-100.
  • Wisdom, John. 1936. “Philosophical Perplexity.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 37, 71-88.
  • Wisdom, John. 1953. Philosophy and Psycho-Analysis. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1965 [1958]. The Blue and Brown Books. New York: Harper and Row.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1994 [1953]. Philosophical Investigations, trans., G. E. M. Anscombe. Oxford: Blackwell.

e. The Paradigm Case Argument

  • Flew, Antony. 1957. “Farewell to the Paradigm-Case Argument: A Comment.” Analysis 18, 34-40.
  • Hanfling, Oswald. 1990. “What is Wrong with the paradigm-Case Argument?” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 99, 21-37.
  • Richman, Robert J. 1961. “On the Argument of the Paradigm Case.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 39, 75-81.
  • Watkins, John William Nevill. 1957. “Farewell to the Paradigm-Case Argument.” Analysis 18, 25-33.

f. Oxford Ordinary Language Philosophy

  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1962. How to Do Things With Words. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1964 [1956]. “A Plea for Excuses.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 41-63.
  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1962. Sense and Sensibilia, ed., G. J. Warnock. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Austin, John Langshaw. 1979. Philosophical Papers, eds., J. O. Urmson and G. J. Warnock. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Cavell, Stanley. 1964 [1958]. “Must We Mean What We Say?” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 75-112.
  • Henson, Richard. 1965. “What We Say.” American Philosophical Quarterly 2, 52-62.
  • McDowell, John. 1994. Mind and World. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1949. The Concept of Mind. London: Hutchinson.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1964 [1953]. “Ordinary Language.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 24-40.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1963 [1957]. “The Theory of Meaning.” In C. Caton, ed., Philosophy and Ordinary Language. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 128-153.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1961. “Use, Usage and Meaning.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volumes 35, 223-230.
  • Searle, John. (Ed.). 1971. The Philosophy of Language. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Collection of essays on the Oxford Ordinary Language approach.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick and Grice, Herbert Paul. 1956. “In Defence of a Dogma.” Philosophical Review 65, 141-158.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 1950. “On Referring.” Mind 59, 320-344.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 1959. Individuals: An Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics. London: Methuen.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 1952. Introduction to Logical Theory. London: Methuen.
  • Strawson, Peter Frederick. 2004 [1971]. Logico-Linguistic Papers. Aldershot: Ashgate.

g. Criticism of Ordinary Language Philosophy

  • Campbell, Chares Arthur. 1944. “Commonsense Propositions and Philosophical Paradoxes.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 45, 1-25.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. 1992 [1951]. “Philosophers and Ordinary Language.” In R. Rorty, ed., The Linguistic Turn. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 175-182.
  • Devitt, Michael and Sterelny, Kim. 1999. Language and Reality: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Language, 2nd ed. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Fodor, Jerry and Katz, Jerrold J. 1971 [1963]. “The Availability of What We Say.” In C. Lyas, ed., Philosophy and Linguistics. London: Macmillan, 190-203.
  • Grice Herbert Paul. 1989. Studies in the Way of Words. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Gellner, Ernest André. 1959. Words and Things: A Critical Account of Linguistic Philosophy and a Study in Ideology. London: Gollancz.
    • A hyperbolic criticism of linguistic philosophies.
  • Lewis, Hywel David. (Ed.). 1963. Clarity is not Enough: Essays in Criticism of Linguistic Philosophy. London: George Allen and Unwin.
    • Early collection of critical essays.
  • Mates, Benson. 1964 [1958]. “On the Verification of Ordinary Language.” In V. C. Chappell, ed., Ordinary Language. Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 64-74.
  • Rollins, Calvin Dwight. 1951. “Ordinary Language and Procrustean Beds.” Mind 60, 223-232.
  • Tennessen, Herman. 1965. “Ordinary Language in Memoriam.” Inquiry 8, 225-248.
  • Weitz, Morris. 1947. “Philosophy and the Abuse of Language.” Journal of Philosophy 44, 533-546.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2007. The Philosophy of Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Woozley, Anthony Douglas. 1953. “Ordinary Language and Common Sense.” Mind 62, 301-312.

h. Contemporary views

  • Borg, Emma. 2004. Minimal Semantics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Pro-truth-conditional, invariant semantics for linguistic meaning.
  • Cappelen, Herman and Lepore, Ernie. 2005. Insensitive Semantics: A Defense of Semantic Minimalism and Speech Act Pluralism. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Pro-truth-conditional, invariant semantics for linguistic meaning.
  • Gendler Szabó, Zoltán. (Ed.). 2005. Semantics versus Pragmatics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Excellent collection of essays targeting the Minimalist/Contextualist debate about linguistic meaning.
  • Hale, Bob and Wright, Crispin. (Eds.). 1997. A Companion to the Philosophy of Language. London: Routledge.
    • Good anthology of relevant essays.
  • King, Jeffrey and Stanley, Jason. 2005. “Semantics, Pragmatics and the Role of Semantic Content.” In Z. Gendler Szabó, ed., Semantics versus Pragmatics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 111-164.
  • Lycan, William. 1999. The Philosophy of Language: A Contemporary Introduction. New York: Routledge.
  • Recanati, Francois. 2004. Literal Meaning. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • Thorough discussion of the Minimalist/Contextualist debate, supportive of a moderately Contextualist view about linguistic meaning.
  • Searle, John. 1969. Speech Acts. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Searle, John. 1979 [1978]. “Literal Meaning.” In J. Searle, ed., Expression and Meaning. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 117-136.
  • Stanley, Jason and Gendler Szabó, Zoltán. 2000. “On Quantifier Domain Restriction.” Mind and Language 15, 219-261.
  • Travis, Charles. 1996. “Meaning’s Role in Truth.” Mind 100, 451-466.
    • A ‘radical’ Contextualist, and anti-Minimalist about linguistic meaning.
  • Travis, Charles. 1999. “Pragmatics.” In B. Hale and C. Wright, eds., A Companion to the Philosophy of Language. London: Routledge, 87-107.

i. Historical and Other Commentaries

  • Hacker, Peter Michael Stephan. 1996. Wittgenstein’s Place in Twentieth-Century Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.
    • Thorough historical account of early analytic philosophy, including detailed biographical information on philosophers – for example, who worked with whom, and who was whose pupils/teachers. Reads easily, as a first-hand account.
  • Hanfling, Oswald. (2000). Philosophy and Ordinary Language: The Bent and Genius of Our Tongue. London: Routledge.
    • One of the only modern defenses of Ordinary Language philosophy.
  • Klibansky, Raymond. (Ed.). 1958. Philosophy in the Mid-Century, Volume 2. Florence: La Nuova Italia.
  • Lyas, Colin. (Ed.). 1971. Philosophy and Linguistics. London: Macmillan.
    • Addresses the debate regarding ‘what we say’, and some Oxford Ordinary Language philosophical disputes.
  • Passmore, John Arthur. 1957. “Wittgenstein and Ordinary Language Philosophy.” In J. A. Passmore, A Hundred Years of Philosophy. London: Duckworth.
    • An early account of Ordinary Language philosophy, at a time when it was still in vogue.
  • Quinton, Anthony. 1958. “Linguistic Analysis.” In R. Klibansky, ed., Philosophy in the Mid-Century, Volume 2. Florence: La Nuova Italia.
    • Excellent bibliography.
  • Soames, Scott. 2003. Philosophical Analysis in the Twentieth Century, Volume 2: The Age of Meaning. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Urmson, James Opie. 1956. Philosophical Analysis: Its Development Between the Two World Wars. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Warnock, Geoffrey James. (Ed.). 1960. The Revolution in Philosophy. London: Macmillan.


Author Information

Sally Parker-Ryan
U. S. A.

Davidson: Philosophy of Language

Donald Davidson (1917-2003) was one of the most influential analytic philosophers of language during the second half of the twentieth century and the first decade of the twenty-first century. An attraction of Davidson’s philosophy of language is the set of conceptual connections he draws between traditional questions about language and issues that arise in other fields of philosophy, including especially the philosophy of mind, action theory, epistemology, and metaphysics. This article addresses only his work on the philosophy of language, but one should bear in mind that this work is properly understood as part of a larger philosophical endeavor.

It is useful to think of Davidson’s project in the philosophy of language as cleaving into two parts. The first, which commences with his earliest publications in the field (Davidson 1965 and 1967), explores and defends his claim that a Tarski-style theory of truth for a language L, modified and supplemented in important ways, suffices to explain how the meanings of the sentences of a language L  depend upon the meanings of words of L, and thus models a significant part of the knowledge someone possesses when she understands L. In other words, Davidson claims that we can adapt a Tarski-style theory of truth to do duty for a theory of meaning. This claim, which is stronger and more complex than it appears at first reading, is examined in section 1.

The second part of Davidson’s work on language (in articles beginning with Davidson 1973 and 1974) addresses issues associated with constructing the sort of meaning theory he proposes in the first part of his project. A Davidsonian theory of meaning is an empirical theory that one constructs to interpret─that is, to describe, systematize, and explain─the linguistic behavior of speakers one encounters in the field or, simply, in line at the supermarket. Again, this problem turns out to be more complex and more interesting than it first appears. This set of issues is examined in section 2.

Table of Contents

  1. Davidson’s Theory of Meaning
    1. Constraints on a Theory of Meaning
      1. Compositionality
      2. No Meaning Entities
    2. Theories of Truth as Theories of Meaning
    3. Meaning and Truth
    4. Formal and Natural Languages
      1. Indexicals
      2. Indirect Discourse
  2. Davidson’s Theory of Interpretation
    1. Radical Translation
    2. Radical Interpretation
      1. Principles of Charity: Coherence
      2. Principles of Charity: Correspondence
    3. Language without Conventions
    4. Indeterminacy of Interpretation
    5. Meaning and Interpretation
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Anthologies of Davidson’s Writings
    2. Individual Articles by Davidson
    3. Primary Works by other Authors
    4. Secondary Sources
      1. Anthologies
      2. Critical Discussions of Davidson’s Philosophy

1. Davidson’s Theory of Meaning

Davidson takes the notion of a theory of meaning as central, so it is important to be clear at the outset what he means by the term. Starting with what he does not mean, it is no part of his project to define the concept of meaning in the sense in which Socrates asks Euthyphro to define piety. Davidson writes that it is folly to try to define the concept of truth (Davidson, 1996), and the same holds for the closely related concept of meaning: both belong to a cluster of concepts so elementary that we should not expect there to be simpler or more basic concepts in terms of which they could be definitionally reduced. Nor does Davidson ask about meaning in such a way that we would expect his answer to take the form,

the meanings of a speaker’s words are such-and-suches.

Locke, who says that meanings of a speaker’s words are ideas in her mind, has a theory of meaning in this sense, as do contemporary philosophers of language who identify meanings with the contents of certain beliefs or intentions of the speaker.

Davidson, therefore, pursues neither a theory of what meaning is nor a theory of what meanings are. Rather, for Davidson a theory of meaning is a descriptive semantics that shows how to pair a speaker’s statements with their meanings, and it does this by displaying how semantical properties or values are distributed systematically over the expressions of her language; in short, it shows how to construct the meanings of a speaker’s sentences out of the meanings of their parts and how those parts are assembled. As a first approximation, one can think of a Davidsonian theory of meaning for the language L as a set of axioms that assign meanings to the lexical elements of the language and which, together with rules for constructing complex expressions of L, imply theorems of the form,

(M)  S means m,

for each sentence S of the language and m its meaning. If an observer of A’s linguistic behavior has such an “M-theorem” for each of his sentences, then she can explain and even make predictions about S's behavior; conversely, we can think of the M-theorems as expressing a body of linguistic knowledge that A possesses and which underwrites his linguistic competence.

a. Constraints on a Theory of Meaning

Much of the interest and originality of Davidson’s work on theories of meaning comes from his choice of Tarski-style theories of truth to serve as the model for theories of meaning. This choice is not obvious, though as early as 1935 Quine remarks that “in point of meaning… a word may be said to be determined to whatever extent the truth or falsehood of its contexts is determined” (Quine 1935, p. 89); it is not obvious since meaning is a richer concept than truth, for example, “snow is white” and “grass is green” agree in both being true, but they differ in meaning. As Davidson sees the matter, though, only theories of truth satisfy certain reasonable constraints on an adequate theory of meaning.

i. Compositionality

The first of these constraints is that a theory of meaning should be compositional. The motivation here is the observation that speakers are finitely endowed creatures, yet they can understand indefinitely many sentences; for example, you never before heard or read the first sentence of this article, but, presumably, you had no difficulty understanding it. To explain this phenomenon, Davidson reasons that language must possess some sort of recursive structure. (A structure is recursive if it is built up by repeatedly applying one of a set of procedures to a result of having applied one of those procedures, starting from one or more base elements.) For unless we can treat the meaning of every sentence of a language L  as the result of a speaker’s or interpreter’s performing a finite number of operations on a finite (though extendable) semantical base, L  will be unlearnable and uninterpretable: no matter how many sentences I master, there will always be others I do not understand. Conversely, if the meaning of each sentence is a product of the meanings of its parts together with the ways those parts are combined, then we can see “how an infinite aptitude can be encompassed by finite accomplishments” (Davidson 1965, p. 8). If every simple sentence of English results from applying a rule to a collection of lexical elements, for example, Combine a noun phrase and an intransitive verb (“Socrates” + “sits” ⇒ “Socrates sits”); and if every complex sentence results from applying a rule to sentences of English, such as Combine two sentences with a conjunction (“Socrates sits” + “Plato stands” ⇒ “Socrates sits and Plato stands”), then although human beings have finite cognitive capacities they can understand indefinitely many sentences. (“Socrates sits,” “Socrates sits and Plato stands,” “Socrates sits and Plato stands and Aristotle swims,” and so forth.)

This, then, gives us the requirement that a theory of meaning be compositional in the sense that it shows how the meanings of complex expressions are systematically “composed” from the meanings of simpler expressions together with a list of their modes of significant combination.

ii. No Meaning Entities

Davidson’s second adequacy constraint on a theory of meaning is that it avoid assigning objects (for example, ideas, universals, or intensions) to linguistic expressions as their meanings. In making this demand, Davidson does not stray into a theory of what meanings are; his point, rather, is that “the one thing meanings do not seem to do is oil the wheels of a theory of meaning… My objections to meanings in the theory of meaning is that… they have no demonstrated use” (Davidson 1967, p. 20).

To see this, consider that traditional logicians and grammarians divided a sentence into a subject term and a predicate term, for example, “Socrates sits” into the subject term “Socrates” and the predicate term “sits,” and assigned to the former as its meaning a certain object, the man Socrates, and to the latter a different sort of object, the universal Sitting, as its meaning. This leaves obscure, however, how the terms “Socrates” and “sits,” or the things Socrates and Sitting, combine to form a proposition, as opposed to, say, the terms “Socrates” and “Plato” (or the objects Socrates and Plato) which cannot combine to form a proposition. It also leaves obscure what role the copula “is” plays in sentences such as “Socrates is wise.” Does “is” refer to a third object that somehow “binds” Socrates to Wisdom? But how does this work? Or does “is” represent some relation? But what relation?

One might solve these difficulties faced by traditional accounts by assigning to different types of expressions different types of entities as their meanings, where these types differ in ways that make the entities amenable to combining in patterns that mirror the ways their corresponding expressions combine. If we read Frege as a Platonist, then his mature semantics is such a theory, since it divides expressions and their meanings, or Bedeutungen, into two types: “saturated” or “complete” expressions and meanings, and “unsaturated” or “incomplete” expressions and their meanings (see, for example, Frege, 1891). The proper noun “Annette” is an expression of the first type, and it means a particular object of the first type, the woman Annette; while the function expression “the father of ( )” belongs to the second type and means a certain nonspatiotemporal entity of the second type, namely, the function that maps objects to their fathers. (The open parentheses marks the argument place of the function expression, which is to be filled with a saturated expression such as “Annette,” and it lines up with a corresponding empty position in the function itself.) There is also the semantical rule that filling the parentheses of the expression, “the father of ( ),” yields a complete expression that means the father of whomever is meant by the saturated expression that fills the parentheses: Annette’s father if “Annette” fills the parentheses, Annette’s father’s father if “the father of Annette” fills the parentheses, and so forth. But now one has to ask, what is the point of our having said that the expression, “the father of ( )” means a certain entity? All the work is being done by the rule we have formulated, and none by the ontology.

There are other methodological considerations that lie behind Davidson’s hostility toward doing semantics by assigning objects and other sorts of entities to words as their meanings. People acquire a language by observing the situated behavior of other people, that is, by observing other people speaking about objects and occurrences in their shared environment; in turn, when they speak, what they mean by their words generally reflects the causes that prompt them to utter those words. These causes are usually mundane sorts of natural things and events, such as other people, grass, people mowing the grass, and the like. This picture of meaning is vague, but it suggests that the psychological achievement of understanding or being able to produce a sentence like “grass is green” rests on the same (or very nearly the same) natural abilities as knowing that grass is green; and it suggests to Davidson that theories of meaning should eschew the esoteric objects and relations that many contemporary philosophies of language presuppose, such as intensions, possible worlds, transworld identity relations, and so forth. By avoiding such things, Davidson positions theories of meaning more closely to the epistemology of linguistic understanding, in the sense of an account of the way that a speaker’s actions and other events are evidence for an interpreter’s attributing meaning to the speaker’s words.

b. Theories of Truth as Theories of Meaning

To begin to see what a Davidsonian theory of meaning looks like, recall schema M,

(M)  S means m,

where sentence S belongs to language L and m is its meaning. Recasting this in a more instructive version,

(M′)  S means that p,

we replace “m” in schema M by the schematic variable “p” in schema M′. In the latter, the schema is filled out by replacing “p” with a sentence in the interpreter’s background or metalanguage that translates the target or object language sentence S. For example, a theory of meaning for German constructed by an English-speaking interpreter might include as an instance of schema M′ the theorem,

“Schnee ist weiss” means that snow is white,

where “Schnee ist weiss” replaces “S” and “snow is white” replaces “p.

Now, schema M′ is more instructive than its predecessor because while the “m” in schema M names an object that S means – in violation of Davidson’s second constraint – the expression “p” holds the place for a sentence (for example, “snow is white”) that the interpreter uses to “track” the meaning of S (“Schnee ist weiss”) without reifying that meaning, that is, without treating that meaning as an object. The sentence that replaces “p” tracks the meaning of S in the sense that schema M′ correlates S (again, “Schnee ist weiss”) with the extra-linguistic condition that p (that snow is white) which the interpreter describes using her own sentence (“snow is white.”)

Schema M′ points the way forward, but we are not there yet. Davidson is not really interested in constructing theories of meaning in the sense of filling out schema M′ for every sentence of German or Urdu; rather, he theorizes about constructing theories of meaning to gain insight into the concept of meaning. And in this regard, schema M′ comes up short: it relies on the relation “means that” which is essentially synonymy across languages, which is as much in need of explication as meaning itself. What Davidson is really interested in is giving an explication, in Carnap’s sense (Carnap 1947, pp. 7-8), of an obscure explanandum, meaning, using a clear and exact explanans, and he finds his explanans in Tarski’s semantic theory of truth.

The semantic theory of truth is not a metaphysical theory of truth in the way that the correspondence theory of truth is. That is, the semantic theory of truth does not tell us what truth is, rather, it defines a predicate that applies to all and only the true sentences of a specified language (technically, true-in-L) by showing how the truth-conditions of a sentence of the language depend on the sentence’s internal structure and certain properties of its parts. This should sound familiar: roughly, the semantic theory of truth does for truth what Davidson wishes to do for meaning. Therefore, Davidson replaces schema M′ with Tarski’s schema T:

(T)  S is true if and only if p.

Schema T sits at the center of Tarski’s project. A formally adequate (that is, internally consistent) definition of truth for a language L is, in addition, materially adequate if it applies to all and only the true sentences of L; Tarski shows that an axiomatic theory θ meets this condition if it satisfies what he calls Convention T, which requires that θ entail for each sentence S of L  an instance of schema T. The idea is that the axioms of θ supply both interpretations for the parts of S, for example,

(A.i) “Schnee” means snow,


(A.ii)  an object a satisfies the German expression “x ist weiss” if and only if a is white,

and rules for forming complex German expressions from simpler ones, such as that

(A.iii)  “Schnee” + “x ist weiss” ⇒ “Schnee ist weiss,”

Together these axioms imply instances of schema T, for example,

“Schnee ist weiss” is true if and only if snow is white.

More precisely, an internally consistent theory of truth θ for a language L meets Convention T if it implies for each S of L an instance of schema T in which “p” is replaced by a sentence from the metalanguage that translates S. Clearly, such a theory will “get it right” in the sense that the T-sentences (that is, the instances of schema T) that θ implies do state truth conditions for the sentences of the object language.

Now, Davidson’s claim is not that a Tarski-style theory of truth in itself is a theory of meaning; in particular, he remarks that a T-sentence cannot be equated with a statement of a sentence’s meaning. At best, a Tarski-style theory of truth is a part of a theory of meaning, with additional resources being brought into play.

c. Meaning and Truth

Notice that Tarski’s Convention T employs the notion of translation, or synonymy across languages, and so a Tarski-style theory of truth cannot, as it stands, supply the explanans Davidson seeks. The underlying point, which Davidson acknowledges “only gradually dawned on me” (1984, p. xiv), is that Tarski analyzes the concept of truth in terms of the concept of meaning (or synonymy), while Davidson’s project depends on making the opposite move: he explains the notion of meaning in terms of truth.

Davidson, therefore, dispenses with translation and rewrites Convention T to require that

an acceptable theory of truth must entail, for every sentence s of the object language, a sentence of the form: s is true if and only if p, where “p” is replaced by any sentence that is true if and only if s is. Given this formulation, the theory is tested by the evidence that T-sentences are simply true; we have given up the idea that we must also tell whether what replaces ‘p’ translates s. (Davidson 1973, p. 134)

Thus, where Tarski requires that “p” translate S, Davidson substitutes the much weaker criterion that the T-sentences “are simply true.”

But Davidson’s weakened Convention T is open to the following objection. Suppose there is a theory of truth for German, θ1, that entails the T-sentence,

(T1)  “Schnee ist weiss” is true if and only if snow is white.

Suppose, further, that there is a second theory of truth for German, θ2, that is just like θ1 except that in place of (T1) it entails the T-sentence,

(T2)  “Schnee ist weiss” is true if and only if grass is green.

A theory of truth that entails (T2) is clearly false, but θ1 satisfies Davidson’s revised Convention T if and only if θ2 also satisfies it.

Here is why. The sentences “snow is white” and “grass is green” both happen to be true, and hence the two sentences are materially equivalent, that is,

Snow is white if and only if grass is green.

(Sentences are materially equivalent if they contingently have the same truth-value; sentences are logically equivalent if they necessarily have the same truth-value.) But since they are materially equivalent, it turns out that:

(T1) is true if and only if (T2 ) is true.

Therefore, all the T-sentences of θ1 are true if and only if all the T-sentences of θ2 are true, and thus θ1 satisfies Davidson’s revised Convention T if and only if θ2 does. The root of this problem is that when it comes to distinguishing between sentences, truth is too coarse a filter to distinguish between materially equivalent sentences with different meanings.

Davidson has a number of responses to this objection (in Davidson 1975). He points out that someone who knows that θ is a materially adequate theory of truth for a language L  knows more than that its T-sentences are true. She knows the axioms of θ, which assign meaning to the lexical elements of L, the words and simple expressions out of which complex expressions and whole sentences are composed; and she knows that these axioms imply the T-sentence correlations between object language sentences (“Schnee ist weiss”) and their interpreting conditions (that snow is white). Thus, someone who knows that θ is a materially adequate theory of truth for a language L   knows a systematic procedure for assigning to the sentences of L   their truth-conditions, making one’s grasp of a theory of truth-cum-meaning a holistic affair: knowing the T-sentence for any one object language sentence is tied to knowing the T-sentences for many object language sentences. (For example, knowing that “‘Schnee ist die Farbe der Wolken” is true if and only if snow is the color of clouds, and that “Schnee ist weiss” is true if and only if snow is white, is tied to knowing that “Wolken sind weiss” is true if and only if clouds are white.) In this way, although Davidson’s version of Convention T -- stated in terms of truth rather than translation -- does not prima facie filter out theories like θ2, such theories will raise red flags as deviant assignments (such as grass to “Schnee”) ramify through the language and interpreters consider the evidence of speakers pointing to snow and uttering, “Das ist Schnee!”

It matters, too, that the T-sentences of a Davidsonian theory of truth-cum-meaning are laws of an empirical theory and not mere accidental generalizations. The important difference here is that as empirical laws and not simple statements of chance correlations, T-sentences support counterfactual inferences: just as it is true that a certain rock would have fallen at 32 ft/sec2 if it had been dropped, even if it was not, it is also true that a German speaker’s utterance of “Schnee ist weiss” would be true if and only if snow is white, even in a world where snow is not white. (But in a world where grass is green, and snow is not white, it is not the case that a German speaker’s utterance of “Schnee ist weiss” would be true if and only if grass is green.)

This means that there is a logically “tighter” connection between the left- and right-hand sides of the T-sentences of materially adequate theories. This logically “tighter” connection underwrites the role that T-sentences have in constructing explanations of speakers’ behavior and, in turn, is a product of the nature of the evidence interpreters employ in constructing Davidsonian theories of truth-cum-meaning. An interpreter witnesses German speakers uttering “Schnee ist weiss!” while indicating freshly fallen snow; the interpreter singles out snow’s being white as the salient feature of the speaker’s environment; and she infers that snow’s being white causes him to hold the sentence, ‘Schnee ist weiss!,” true. Thus, the connection between snow’s being white and the T-sentence is more than a chance correlation, and this gets expressed by there being something stronger than an extensional relation between a statement of the evidence and the theory.

This has often been taken to be a fatal concession, inasmuch as Davidson is understood to be committed to giving an extensional account of the knowledge someone possesses when she understands a language. However, Davidson denies that he is committed to giving an extensional account of an interpreter’s knowledge; all he is after is formulating the theory of truth-cum-meaning itself in extensional terms, and he allows that ancillary knowledge about that theory may involve concepts or relations that cannot be expressed in extensionalist terms. Thus, it is not an objection to his project that an interpreter’s background logic, for example, in her understanding of her own theory, should involve appeal to intensional notions.

d. Formal and Natural Languages

Tarski restricts his attention to investigating the semantical properties of formal languages, whereas Davidson’s interest lies in the investigation of natural languages. Formal languages are well-behaved mathematical objects whose structures can be exactly and exhaustively described in purely syntactical terms, while natural languages are anything but well-behaved. They are plastic and subject to ambiguity, and they contain myriad linguistic forms that resist, to one degree or another, incorporation into a theory of truth via the methods available to the logical semanticist. Davidson has written on the problems posed by several of these linguistic forms (in Davidson 1967a, 1968, 1978, and 1979) including indexicals, adverbial modifiers, indirect discourse, metaphor, mood, and the propositional attitudes.

i. Indexicals

It is instructive to see how Davidson handles indexicals. The key insight here is that truth is properly a property of the situated production of a sentence token by a speaker at a certain time, that is, it is a property of an utterance, not a sentence. We define, therefore, an utterance to be an ordered triple consisting of a sentence token, a time, and a speaker. Truth is thus a property of such a triple, and in constructing a Tarski-style theory of truth for a language L the goal is to have it entail T-theorems such as:

“Das ist weiss” is true when spoken by x at t if and only if the object indicated by x at t is white.

This T-theorem captures two distinct indexical elements. First, the German pronoun “das” refers to the object the speaker indicates when she makes her utterance; we model its contribution to the utterance’s truth-condition by explicitly referring on the right side of the T-theorem to that object. Second, the German verb “ist” is conjugated in the present indicative tense and refers to the time the speaker performs her utterance. We represent this indexical feature by repeating the time variable “t” on both sides of the T-theorem. Not all sentences contain indexicals (“that,” “she,” “he,” “it”, “I,” “here,” “now,” “today,” and so forth, but unless it is formulated in the so-called “eternal present” (for example, “5 plus 7 is twelve”), every sentence contains an indexical element in the tense of the sentence’s main verb.

ii. Indirect Discourse

The philosophy of language is thick with proposals for treating the anomalous behavior of linguistic contexts involving intensional idioms, including especially indirect discourse and propositional attitude constructions. In such contexts, familiar substitution patterns fail; for example, it is true that

(1)  The Earth moves,

and that

(2)  The Earth = the planet on which D.D. was born in 1917.

By the Principle of Extensionality,

Co-referring terms can be exchanged without affecting the truth-value of contexts in which those terms occur,

we can infer that

The planet on which D.D. was born in 1917 moves.

However, if we report that Galileo said that (1), that is,

(3)  Galileo said that the Earth moves,

we are blocked from making the substitution,

(4)  Galileo said that the planet on which D.D. was born in 1917 moves,

for surely Galileo did not say that, since he died nearly three hundred years before D.D. was born. (2) and (3) are true, while (4) is false; hence (2) and (3) do not entail (4), and the Principle of Extensionality fails for “says that” contexts.

Davidson’s solution to this problem is as ingenious as it is controversial, for it comes at the price of some grammatical novelty. He argues that the word “that” that occurs in (3) is a demonstrative pronoun and not, as grammar books tell us, a relative pronoun; the direct object of “said” is this demonstrative, and not the subordinate noun clause “that the Earth moves.” In fact, under analysis this noun clause disappears and becomes two separate expressions: the demonstrative “that,” which completes the open sentence “Galileo said x,” and the grammatically independent sentence “The Earth moves.” This new sentence is the demonstrative’s referent; or, rather, its referent is the speaker’s utterance of the sentence, “The Earth moves,” which follows her utterance of the sentence “Galileo said that.” Thus Davidson proposes that from a logical point of view, (3) is composed of two separate utterances:

(5)  Galileo said that. The Earth moves.

In other words, the grammatical connection between “The Earth moves” and “Galileo said that” is severed and replaced by the same relationship that connects snow and my pointing to snow and saying “That is white.”

More properly, (5) should be:

(6)  Galileo said something that meant the same as my next utterance. The Earth moves.

This qualification is needed, since the utterance to which “that” refers in (5) is my utterance of a sentence in my language, which I use to report an utterance Galileo made in his language. As Davidson sometimes puts it, Galileo and I are samesayers: what he and I mean, when he performs his utterance and I perform mine, is the same. Finally, a careful semantical analysis of (6) should look something like this:

(7)  There exists some utterance x performed by Galileo, and x means the same in Galileo’s idiolect as my next utterance means in mine. The Earth moves.

Now in my utterance, “the Earth” can be exchanged for “the planet on which D.D. was born in 1917” because as I use them both expressions refer to the same object, namely, the Earth. Thus, the Principle of Extensionality is preserved.

Davidson proposes that this account can be extended to treat other opaque constructions in the object language, such as the propositional attitudes (Davidson 1975) and entailment relations (Davidson 1976). Looking at the former, the idea is that by analogy with (3), (5), and (6),

(8)  Galileo believed that the Earth moves,

should be glossed as

(9)  Galileo believed that. The Earth moves,

or, better,

(10)  Galileo believed something that had the same content meant as my next utterance. The Earth moves.

A question, then, is what is this something that Galileo believed? In the analysis of indirect discourse, my sentence (“The Earth moves”) tracks an actual utterance of Galileo’s (“Si muove”), but Galileo had many beliefs he never expressed verbally; so it cannot be an utterance of Galileo’s. Alternatively, one might treat thoughts as inner mental representations and belief as a relation between thinkers and thoughts so conceived; then what has the same content as my utterance of my sentence, “The Earth moves,” is Galileo’s mental representation in his language of thought. However, Davidson argues elsewhere (Davidson 1989) that believing is not a relation between thinker and mental objects; this point is important to the position he stakes out in the internalism/externalism debate in the philosophy of mind.

Instead, Davidson proposes (in Davidson 1975) that (3) is to (6) as (8) is to:

(11)  Galileo would be honestly speaking his mind were he to say something that had the same content as my next utterance. The Earth moves.

Galileo never actually said something that means the same as my sentence, “The Earth moves,” but had he spoken his mind about the matter, he would have. (Historically, of course, Galileo did say such a thing, but let us suppose that he did not.) This analysis, however, imports a counterfactual condition into the T-sentences of an interpreter’s theory for Galileo’s words and thoughts, which Davidson wants to avoid. Finally, in the same article Davidson seems to suggest that we treat Galileo’s thought more directly as a “belief state,” which might be glossed as:

(12)  Galileo was in some belief state that had the same content meant as my next utterance. The Earth moves.

Intuitively, this seems right: what I track with my utterance is precisely the content of Galileo’s belief. This leaves open, however, what “belief states” are such that they can be quantified over (as in (10)) and have contents that can be tracked by utterances. This, though, is a problem for the philosophy of mind rather than the philosophy of language, and there is no reason to suppose that it affects Davidson’s proposal more than other accounts of the semantics of the propositional attitudes.

2. Davidson’s Theory of Interpretation

Consideration of the exigencies of interpreting a person’s speech behavior yields additional constraints on theories of truth-cum-meaning, and it also provides deep insights into the nature of language and meaning. Davidson examines interpretation and the construction of theories of meaning by drawing extensively on the work of his mentor, W. V. Quine.

a. Radical Translation

In Quine’s famous thought experiment of radical translation, we imagine a “field linguist” who observes the verbal behavior of speakers of a foreign language, and we reflect on her task of constructing a translation manual that maps the speakers’ language onto her own. The translation task is radical in the sense that Quine assumes she has no prior knowledge whatsoever of the speakers’ language or its relation to her home language. Hence her only evidence for constructing and testing her translation manual are her observations of the speakers’ behavior and their relation to their environment.

The linguist’s entering wedge into a foreign language are those of the speakers’ utterances that seem to bear directly on conspicuous features of the situation she shares with her subject. Taking Quine’s well-known example, suppose a rabbit scurries within the field of view of both the linguist and an alien speaker, who then utters, “Gavagai!” With this as her initial evidence, the linguist sifts through the features of the complex situation that embeds his speech behavior; she reasons that were she in the subject’s position of seeing a rabbit, she would be disposed to assert, “Lo, a rabbit!” Supposing, then, that the alien speaker’s verbal dispositions relate to his environment as her verbal disposition are related to her own, she tentatively translates “Gavagai!” with her own sentence, “Lo, a rabbit!”

b. Radical Interpretation

Taking his inspiration from Quine, Davidson holds that a radical interpreter thus begins with observations such as:

(13)  A belongs to a community of speakers of a common language, call it K, and he holds “Gavagai!” true on Saturday at noon, and there is a rabbit visible to A on Saturday at noon,

and eliciting additional evidence from observing K-speakers’ situated verbal behavior, she infers that

(14)  If x is a K-speaker, then x holds “Gavagai!” true at t if and only if there is a rabbit visible to x at t.

This inference is subject to the vagaries that attend empirical research, but having gathered an adequate sample of instances of K-speakers holding “Gavagai” true when and only when rabbits cross their paths, she takes (14) to be confirmed. In turn, then, she takes (14) as support that (partly) confirms the following T-sentence of a Tarski-style truth theory for K:

(15)  “Gavagai!” is true when spoken by x at t if and only there is a rabbit visible to x at t.

Note that in reconstructing the language K, Davidson’s linguist does not mention sentences of her home language. Of course, she uses her own sentences in making these assignments, but her sentences are directed upon extra-linguistic reality. Thus, unlike a Quinean radical translator, who does mention sentences of his home language, a Davidsonian radical interpreter adopts a semantical stance: she relates speakers’ sentences to the world by assigning them objective truth conditions describing extra-linguistic situations and objects. It is in this sense that a Davidsonian linguist is an interpreter, and Davidson calls the project undertaken by his linguist the construction of a theory of interpretation.

i. Principles of Charity: Coherence

Like any empirical scientist, a Davidsonian radical interpreter relies on methodological assumptions she makes to move from her observations (13) to her intermediate conclusions (14) and to the final form of her theory (15). Davidson identifies as the radical interpreter’s two most important methodological assumptions the Principle of (Logical) Coherence and the Principle of Correspondence. Taken together these canons of interpretation are known, somewhat misleadingly, as the Principle(s) of Charity.

Since a Davidsonian theory of interpretation is modeled on a Tarski-style theory of truth, one of the first steps an interpreter takes is to look for a coherent structure in the sentences of alien speakers. She does this by assuming that a speaker’s behavior satisfies strong, normative constraints, namely, that he reasons in accordance with logical laws. Making this assumption, she can diagram the logical patterns in speakers’ verbal behavior and leverage evidence she gleans from her observations into a detailed picture of the internal structure of his language.

Assuming that a speaker reasons in accordance with logical laws is neither an empirical hypothesis about a subject’s intellectual capacities nor an expression of the interpreter’s goodwill toward her subject. Satisfying the norms of rationality is a condition on speaking a language and having thoughts, and hence failing to locate sufficient consistency in someone’s behavior means there is nothing to interpret. The assumption that someone is rational is a foundation on which the project of interpreting his utterances rests.

ii. Principles of Charity: Correspondence

The problem the radical interpreter faces is that by hypothesis she does not know what a speaker’s sentences mean, and neither does she have direct access to the contents of his propositional attitudes, such as his beliefs or desires. Both of these factors bear on making sense of his verbal behavior, however, for which sentences a speaker puts forward as true depends simultaneously on the meanings of those sentences and on his beliefs. For example, a K-speaker utters “Gavagai!” only if (α) the sentence is true if and only if a rabbit presents itself to him, and (β) he believes that a rabbit presents itself to him.

A speaker’s holding a sentence true is thus (as Davidson put it) a “vector of two forces” (Davidson 1974a, p. 196), what meanings his words have and what he believes about the world. The interpreter thus faces the problem of too many unknowns, which she solves by performing her own thought experiment: she projects herself into her subject’s shoes and assumes that he does or would believe what she, were she in his position, would believe. This solves the problem of her not knowing what the speaker believes since she knows what she would believe were she in his situation, and hence she knows what her subject does believe if he believes what she thinks he ought to believe. The Principle of Correspondence is the methodological injunction that an interpreter affirm the if-clause.

The Principle of Correspondence applies especially to speakers’ observation sentences, for example, there goes a rabbit! These are the points of immediate causal contact between the world shared by speakers and interpreters, on the one hand, and the utterances and attitudes of speakers, on the other. Where there is greater distance between cause (features of the speaker’s situation) and effect (which sentences the speaker puts forward as true), there are extra degrees of freedom in explaining how the speaker might reasonably hold true something that the interpreter believes is false.

Davidson sometimes formulates the Principle of Correspondence in terms of the interpreter’s maximizing agreement between her and the speakers she interprets, but this is misleading. An interpreter needs to fill out the contents of the speaker’s attitudes if her project is to move forward; and she does this by attributing to him those beliefs that allow her to tell the most coherent story about what he believes. Thus, she routes attributions of beliefs to the speaker through what she knows about his beliefs and values. An interpreter will still export to her subject a great deal of her own world view, but if there are grounds for attributing to him certain beliefs that she takes to be false, then she does so if what she knows about him makes it more reasonable than not. She thus makes use of whatever she knows about the speaker’s personal history and psychology.

c. Language without Conventions

Davidson typically presents radical interpretation as targeting a community’s language, but in his more careful statements he argues that the focus of interpretation is the speech behavior of a single individual over a given stretch of time (Davidson 1986). One reason for this is that Davidson denies that conventions shared by members of a linguistic community play any philosophically interesting role in an account of meaning. Shared conventions facilitate communication, but they are in principle dispensible. For so long as an audience discerns the intention behind a speaker’s utterance, for example, he intends that his utterance of “Schnee ist weiss” mean that snow is white, then his utterance means that snow is white, regardless of whether he and they share the practice that speakers use “Schnee ist weiss” to mean that snow is white. This point is implicit in the project of radical interpretation.

This implies, according to Davidson, that what we ordinarily think of as a single natural language, such as German or Urdu, is like a smooth curve drawn through the idiolects of different speakers. It also underwrites Davidson’s claim that “interpretation is domestic as well as foreign” (Davidson 1973, p. 125), that is, there is no essential difference between understanding the words spoken by radically alien speakers and our familiars; there is only the practical difference that one has more and better information about the linguistic behavior and propositional attitudes of those with whom one has more contact.

d. Indeterminacy of Interpretation

Davidson, following Quine, argues that although the methodology of radical interpretation (or translation, for Quine) winnows the field of admissible candidates, it does not identify a unique theory that best satisfies its criteria. At the end of the day there will be competing theories that are mutually inconsistent but which do equally well in making sense of a speaker’s utterance, and in this sense interpretation (and translation) is indeterminate.

Quine draws from this the skeptical conclusion that there is “no fact of the matter” when it comes to saying what speakers or their words mean. Davidson stops short of Quine’s skepticism, and he draws a different moral from the indeterminacy arguments. (In this section we emphasize Davidson’s agreements with Quine, in the following his disagreement.)

Here is how indeterminacy infects the task of the radical translator. She begins with a speaker’s situated observation sentences, and she finds her first success in correlating a sentence SH of her home language with a sentence SO of her subject’s language. She hypothesizes that SH and SO are synonymous, and this is her wedge into the speaker’s language. Next, the translator makes hypotheses about how to segment the speaker’s observation sentences into words (or morphemes) and about how to line these up with words of her own language. For example, she may identify the initial vocable of “Gavagai!,” “ga,” with the demonstrative “there” in her home language, and “gai” with the common noun “rabbit.” This permits her to puzzle out the translation of nonobservation sentences that share some of their parts with observation sentences. (In the Davidsonian version, these correlations take the form of interpretations rather than translations, but the point is the same.)

These additional hypotheses are essential to her project, but they are not backed by any direct behavioral evidence. They are confirmed just so long as the translations or interpretations they warrant are consistent with the linguist’s evidence for her evolving theory; however, that evidence has the form of information about the translation or interpretation of complete sentences. Indeterminacy arrives on the scene, then, because different sets of hypotheses and the translations or interpretations they imply do equally well in making sense of a speaker’s sentences, even though they assign different translations or interpretations to the parts of those sentences.

Indeterminacy, however, also infects the translation and interpretation of complete sentences. This is because the evidence for a translation manual or theory of interpretation does not, in fact, come at the level of sentences. The radical translator or interpreter does not test her translations or T-sentences one-by-one; rather, what goes before the tribunal of evidence is a complete translation manual or theory of interpretation for the entire language (Quine 1953). This means that in the case of sentences, too, there is slack between evidence and a translation or interpretation as the linguist may vary the translation or interpretation of a given sentence by making complementary changes elsewhere in her translation manual or theory of interpretation. Thus the interpretation of sentences as well as terms is indeterminate.

e. Meaning and Interpretation

Davidson’s response to the indeterminacy arguments is at the same time more modest and more ambitious than Quine’s. It is more modest because Davidson does not endorse the skeptical conclusion that Quine draws from the arguments that since there are no determinate meanings, there are no meanings. This reasoning is congenial to Quine’s parsimony and his behaviorism: all there is, according to Quine, are speaker’s behavior and dispositions to behave and whatever can be constructed from or explained in terms of that behavior and those dispositions.

It is more ambitious than Quine’s response insofar as Davidson offers in place of Quine’s skepticism what Hume would call a skeptical solution to the indeterminacy problem. That is, while acknowledging the validity of Quine’s argument that there are no meanings, he undertakes to reconceive the concept of meaning that figures as a premise in that reasoning (as Hume reconceives the concept of causation that figures in his skeptical arguments). There are no determinate meanings, therefore, meaning is not determinate. In place of the traditional picture of meanings as semantical quanta that speakers associate with their verbal expressions, Davidson argues that meaning is the invariant structure that is common to the competing interpretations of speakers’ behavior (Davidson 1999, p. 81). That there is such a structure is implied by holism: in assigning a certain meaning to a single utterance, an interpreter has already chosen one of a number of competing theories to interpret a speaker’s over-all language. Choosing that theory, in turn, presupposes that she has identified in the speaker’s utterances a pattern or structure she takes that theory to describe at least as well as any other. Herein lies the Indeterminacy of Interpretation, for that theory does only at least as well as any other. There is, therefore, no more an objective basis for choosing one theory of meaning over another than there is for preferring the Fahrenheit to the Celsius scale for temperature ascriptions.

This conclusion, however, has no skeptical implications, for by assumption each theory does equally well at describing the same structure. Whether there is a “fact of the matter” when it comes to saying what speakers or their sentences mean, therefore, becomes the question whether there are objective grounds for saying that that structure exists. That structure is a property of a system of events, and hence the grounds for saying that it exists are the criteria for attributing those properties to those events; the skeptical conclusion would follow, therefore, only if there were no such criteria. The argument for the Indeterminacy of Interpretation does not prove that, however. On the contrary, the methodology of radical interpretation provides a framework for attributing patterns of properties to speakers and their utterances.

As Davidson reconceives it, therefore, understanding a person’s sentences involves discerning patterns in his situated actions, but no discrete “meanings.” An interpreter makes sense of her interlocutor by treating him as a rational agent and reflecting on the contents of her own propositional attitudes, and she tracks what his sentences mean with her own sentences. This project may fail in practice, especially where the interpretation is genuinely radical and there is moral as well as linguistic distance separating an interpreter and a speaker; but in principle there is no linguistic behavior that cannot be interpreted, that is, understood, by another. If an interpreter can discern a pattern in a creature’s situated linguistic behavior, then she can make sense of his words; alternatively, if she cannot interpret his utterances, then she has no grounds for attributing meaning to the sounds he produces nor evidence to support the hypothesis that he is a rational agent. These observations are not a statement of linguistic imperialism; rather, they are implications of the methodology of interpretation and the role that Tarski-style theories of truth-cum-meaning play in the enterprise. Meaning is essentially intersubjective.

Further, meaning is objective in the sense that most of what speakers say about the world is true of the world. Some critics object that this statement rests on an optimistic assessment of human capacities for judgment; however, Davidson’s point is not an empirical claim that could turn out to be mistaken. Rather, it is a statement of the methodology of radical interpretation, an assumption an interpreter makes to gain access to her subject’s language. Her only path into his language is by way of the world they share since she makes sense of his sentences by discerning patterns in the relations between those sentences and the objects and events in the world that cause him to hold those sentences true. If too many of his utterances are false, then the link between what he says and thinks, on the one hand, and the world, on the other, is severed; and the enterprise of interpretation halts. Finding too much unexplainable error in his statements about the world, therefore, is not an option, if she is going to interpret him.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Anthologies of Davidson’s Writings

  • Davidson, Donald. 1984. Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation. New York: Oxford University Press. [Cited as ITI]
  • Davidson, Donald. 2001. Essays on Actions and Events. Oxford University Press. [Cited as EAE]
  • Davidson, Donald. 2001. Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective. New York: Oxford University Press. [Cited as SIO]
  • Davidson, Donald. 2005. Truth, Language, and History. New York: Oxford University Press. [Cited as TLH]
  • Davidson, Donald. 2005A. Truth and Predication. Boston: Harvard University Press.
    • Contains the texts of Davidson’s 1989 Dewey Lectures (given at Columbia University) on the concept of truth together with his 2001 Hermes Lectures (given at the University of Perugia). The first half is useful in understanding the role truth plays in his systematic philosophy, and the second half contains Davidson’s interesting criticisms of his predecessors, ranging from Plato to Quine.

b. Individual Articles by Davidson

  • Davidson, Donald. 1965. “Theories of Meaning and Learnable Languages,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1967. “Truth and Meaning,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1967a. “The Logical Form of Action Sentences,” reprinted in EAE.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1968. “On Saying That,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1973. “Radical Interpretation,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1974. “Belief and the Basis of Meaning,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1974a. “On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1975. “Thought and Talk,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1976. “Reply to Foster,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1978. “What Metaphors Mean,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1986. “A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs,” reprinted in TLH.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1989. “What is Present to the Mind?”, reprinted in SIO.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1996. “The Folly of Trying to Define Truth,” reprinted in TLH.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1999. “Reply to W.V. Quine,” printed in Hahn 1999.

c. Primary Works by other Authors

  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1947., Meaning and Necessity, 2nd ed. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1891. “Funktion und Begriff,” translated as “Function and Concept” and reprinted in Brian McGuinness et al. (eds.), Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic, and Philosophy, 1984. New York: Basil Blackwell.
  • Quine, W.V. 1935. “Truth by Convention,” reprinted in The Ways of Paradox, 1976. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

d. Secondary Sources

i. Anthologies

  • De Caro, Marion. 1999. Interpretations and Causes: New Perspectives on Donald Davidson’s Philosophy. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
    • Articles by an internationally diverse range of authors focusing on the interplay between the notions of interpretation and causation in Davidson’s philosophy.
  • Dasenbrock, Reed Way. 1993. Literary Theory After Davidson. University Park: Penn State Press.
    • Articles addressing the significance of Davidson’s philosophy of language for literary theory.
  • Hahn, Edwin Lewis. 1999. The Philosophy of Donald Davidson. The Library of Living Philosophers, volume XXVII. Peru, IL: Open Court Publishing Company.
    • A useful collection of articles, including Davidson’s intellectual autobiography and his replies to authors.
  • Kotatko, Petr, Pagin, Peter and Segal, Gabriel. 2001. Interpreting Davidson. Stanford, CA: Center for the Study of Language and Information Publications.
  • Lepore, Ernest. 1986. Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
    • An excellent collection of articles addressing a range of topics in Davidson’s philosophy of language.
  • Stoecker, Ralf. 1993. Reflecting Davidson: Donald Davidson Responding to an International Forum of Philosophers. Berlin: de Gruyter.

ii. Critical Discussions of Davidson’s Philosophy

  • Evnine, Simon. 1991. Donald Davidson. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Joseph, Marc. 2004. Donald Davidson. Montreal: McGill-Queens University Press.
  • Lepore, Ernest, and Ludwig, Kirk. 2005. Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language, and Reality. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Lepore, Ernest, and Ludwig, Kirk. 2009. Donald Davidson’s Truth-Theoretic Semantics. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • A detailed and technical examination of Davidson’s use of Tarski-style theories of truth in his semantical project.
  • Ramberg, Bjørn. 1989. Donald Davidson’s Philosophy of Language. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.

Author Information

Marc A. Joseph
Mills College
U. S. A.

Relational Models Theory

Relational Models Theory is a theory in cognitive anthropology positing a biologically innate set of elementary mental models and a generative computational system operating upon those models.  The computational system produces compound models, using the elementary models as a kind of lexicon.  The resulting set of models is used in understanding, motivating, and evaluating social relationships and social structures.  The elementary models are intuitively quite simple and commonsensical.  They are as follows: Communal Sharing (having something in common), Authority Ranking (arrangement into a hierarchy), Equality Matching (striving to maintain egalitarian relationships), and Market Pricing (use of ratios).  Even though Relational Models Theory is classified as anthropology, it bears on several philosophical questions.

It contributes to value theory by describing a mental faculty which plays a crucial role in generating a plurality of values.  It thus shows how a single human nature can result in conflicting systems of value.  The theory also contributes to philosophy of cognition.  The complex models evidently result from a computational operation, thus supporting the view that a part of the mind functions computationally.  The theory contributes  to metaphysics.  Formal properties posited by the theory are perhaps best understood abstractly, raising the possibility that these mental models correspond to abstract objects.  If so, then Relational Models Theory reveals a Platonist ontology.

Table of Contents

  1. The Theory
    1. The Elementary Models
    2. Resemblance to Classic Measurement Scales
    3. Self-Organization and Natural Selection
    4. Compound Models
    5. Mods and Preos
  2. Philosophical Implications
    1. Moral Psychology
    2. Computational Conceptions of Cognition
    3. Platonism
  3. References
    1. Specifically Addressing Relational Models Theory
    2. Related Issues

1. The Theory

a. The Elementary Models

The anthropologist Alan Page Fiske pioneered Relational Models Theory (RMT).  RMT was originally conceived as a synthesis of certain constructs concerning norms formulated by Max Weber, Jean Piaget, and Paul Ricoeur.  Fiske then explored the theory among the Moose people of Burkina Faso in Africa.  He soon realized that its application was far more general, giving special insight into human nature.  According to RMT, humans are naturally social, using the relational models to structure and understand social interactions, the application of these models seen as intrinsically valuable. All relational models, no matter how complex, are, according to RMT, analyzable by four elementary models: Communal Sharing, Authority Ranking, Equality Matching, Market Pricing.

Any relationship informed by Communal Sharing presupposes a bounded group, the members of which are not differentiated from each other.  Distinguishing individual identities are socially irrelevant.  Generosity within a Communal Sharing group is not usually conceived of as altruism due to this shared identity, even though there is typically much behavior which otherwise would seem like extreme altruism.  Members of a Communal Sharing relationship typically feel that they share something in common, such as blood, deep attraction, national identity, a history of suffering, or the joy of food.  Examples include nationalism, racism, intense romantic love, indiscriminately killing any member of an enemy group in retaliation for the death of someone in one’s own group, sharing a meal.

An Authority Ranking relationship is a hierarchy in which individuals or groups are placed in relative higher or  lower relations .  Those ranked higher have prestige and privilege not enjoyed by those who are lower.  Further, the higher typically have some control over the actions of those who are lower.  However, the higher also have duties of protection and pastoral care for those beneath them.  Metaphors of spatial relation, temporal relation, and magnitude are typically used to distinguish people of different rank. For example, a King having a larger audience room than a Prince, or a King arriving after a Prince for a royal banquet.  Further examples include military rankings, the authority of parents over their children especially in more traditional societies, caste systems, and God’s authority over humankind.  Brute coercive manipulation is not considered to be Authority Ranking; it is more properly categorized as the Null Relation in which people treat each other in non-social ways.

In Equality Matching, one attempts to achieve and sustain an even balance and one-to-one correspondence between individuals or groups.  When there is not a perfect balance, people try to keep track of the degree of imbalance in order to calculate how much correction is needed.  “Equality matching is like using a pan balance: People know how to assemble actions on one side to equal any given weight on the other side” (Fiske 1992, 691).  If you and I are out of balance, we know what would restore equality.  Examples include the principle of one-person/one-vote, rotating credit associations, equal starting points in a race, taking turns offering dinner invitations, and giving an equal number of minutes to each candidate to deliver an on-air speech.

Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interaction.  This can involve maximization or minimization as in trying to maximize profit or minimize loss.  But it can also involve arriving at an intuitively fair proportion, as in a judge deciding on a punishment proportional to a crime.  In Market Pricing, all socially relevant properties of a relationship are reduced to a single measure of value, such as money or pleasure.  Most utilitarian principles involve maximization.  An exception would be Negative Utilitarianism whose principle is the minimization of suffering.  But all utilitarian principles are applications of Market Pricing, since the maximum and the minimum are both proportions.  Other examples include rents, taxes, cost-benefit analyses including military estimates of kill ratios and proportions of fighter planes potentially lost, tithing, and prostitution.

RMT has been extensively corroborated by controlled studies based on research using a great variety of methods investigating diverse phenomena, including cross-cultural studies (Haslam 2004b).  The research shows that the elementary models play an important role in cognition including perception of other persons.

b. Resemblance to Classic Measurement Scales

It may be jarring to learn that intense romantic love and racism are both categorized as Communal Sharing or that tithing and prostitution are both instances of Market Pricing.  These examples illustrate that a relational model is, at its core, a meaningless formal structure.  Implementation in interpersonal relations and attendant emotional associations enter in on a different level of mental processing.  Each model can be individuated in purely formal terms, each elementary model strongly resembling one of the classic scale types familiar from measurement theory.  (Strictly speaking, it is each mod which can be individuated in purely formal terms.  This finer point will be discussed in the next section.)

Communal Sharing resembles a nominal (categorical) scale.  A nominal scale is simply classifying things into categories.  A questionnaire may be designed to categorize people as theist, atheist, agnostic, and other.  Such a questionnaire is measuring religious belief by using a nominal scale.  The groups into which Communal Sharing sorts people is similar.  One either belongs to a pertinent group or one does not, there being no degree or any shades of gray.  Another illustration of nominal scaling is the pass/fail system of grading.  Authority Ranking resembles an ordinal scale in which items are ranked.  The ranking of students according to their performance is one example.  The ordered classification of shirts in a store as small, medium, large, and extra large is another.  Equality Matching resembles an interval scale.  On interval scales , any unit measures the same magnitude on any point in the scale.  For example, on the Celsius scale the difference between 1 degree and 2 degrees is the same as the difference between 5 degrees and 6 degrees.  Equality Matching resembles an interval scale insofar as one can measure the degree of inequality in a social relationship using equal intervals so as to judge how to correct the imbalance.  It is by use of such a scale that people in an Equality Matching interaction can specify how much one person owes another.  However, an interval scale cannot be used to express a ratio because it has no absolute zero point.  For example, the zero point on the Celsius scale is not absolute so one cannot say that 20 degrees is twice as warm as 10 degrees while on a Kelvin scale because the zero point is absolute one can express ratios.  Given that Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interactions, it resembles a ratio scale such as the Kelvin scale.  One cannot, for example, meaningfully speak of the maximization of utility without presupposing some sort of ratio scale for measuring utility.  Maximization would correspond to 100 percent.

c. Self-Organization and Natural Selection

The four measurement scales correspond to different levels of semantic richness and precision.  The nominal scale conveys little information, being very coarse grained.  For example, pass/fail grading conveys less information than ranking students.  Giving letter grades is even more precise and semantically rich, conveying how much one student out-performs another.  This is the use of an interval scale.  The most informative and semantically rich is a percentage grade which illustrates the ratio by which one student out-performs another, hence a ratio scale.  For example, if graded accurately a student scoring 90 percent has done twice as well as a student scoring 45 percent.  Counterexamples may be apparent: two students could be ranked differently while receiving the same letter grade by using a deliberately coarse-grained letter grading system so as to minimize low grades.  To take an extreme case, a very generous instructor might award an A to every student (after all, no student was completely lost in class) while at the same time mentally ranking the students in terms of their performance.  Split grades are sometimes used to smooth out the traditional coarse-grained letter grading system .  But, if both scales are as sensitive as possible and based on the same data, the interval scale will convey more information than the ordinal scale.  The ordinal ranking will be derivable from the interval grading, but not vice versa.  This is more obvious in the case of temperature measurement, in which grade inflation is not an issue.  Simply ranking objects in terms of warmer/colder conveys less information than does Celsius measurement.

One scale is more informative than another because it is less symmetrical; greater asymmetry means that more information is conveyed.  On a measurement scale, a permutation which distorts or changes information is an asymmetry.  Analogously, a permutation in a social-relational arrangement which distorts or changes social relations is an asymmetry.  In either case, a permutation which does not carry with it such a distortion or change is symmetric.  The nominal scale type is the most symmetrical scale type, just as Communal Sharing is the most symmetrical elementary model.  In either case, the only asymmetrical permutation is one which moves an item out of a category, for example, expelling someone from the social group.  Any permutation within the category or group makes no difference; no difference to the information conveyed, no difference to the social relation.  In the case of pass/fail grading, the student’s performance could be markedly different from what it actually was.  So long as the student does well enough to pass (or poorly enough to fail), this would not have changed the grade.  Thanks to this high degree of symmetry, the nominal scale conveys relatively little information.

The ordinal scale is less symmetrical.  Any permutation that changes rankings is asymmetrical, since it distorts or changes something significant.  But items arranged could change in many respects relative to each other while their ordering remains unaffected, so a high level of symmetry remains.  Students could vary in their performance, but so long as their relative ranking remains the same, this would make no difference to grades based on an ordinal scale.

An interval scale is even less symmetrical and hence more informative, as seen in the fact that a system of letter grades conveys more information than does a mere ranking of students.  An interval scale conveys the relative degrees of difference between items.  If one student improves from doing C level work to B level work, this would register on an interval scale but would remain invisible on an ordinal scale if the change did not affect student ranking.  Analogously, in Equality Matching, if one person, and one person only, were to receive an extra five minutes to deliver their campaign speech, this would be socially significant.  By contrast, in Authority Ranking, the addition of an extra five minutes to the time taken by a Prince to deliver a speech would make no socially significant difference provided that the relative ranking remains undisturbed (for example, the King still being allotted more time than the Prince, and the Duke less than the Prince).

In Market Pricing, as in any ratio scale, the asymmetry is even greater.  Adding five years to the punishment of every convict could badly skew what should be proportionate punishments.  But giving an extra five minutes to each candidate would preserve balance in Equality Matching.

The symmetries of all the scale types have an interesting formal property.  They form a descending symmetry subgroup chain.  In other words, the symmetries of a ratio scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant interval scale, the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant ordinal scale, and the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant nominal scale.  More specifically, the scale types form a containment hierarchy.  Analogously, the symmetries of Market Pricing form a subset of the symmetries of Equality Matching which form a subset of the symmetries of Authority Ranking which form a subset of the symmetries of Communal Sharing.  Descending subgroup chains are common in nature, including inorganic nature.  The symmetries of solid matter form a subset of the symmetries of liquid matter which form a subset of the symmetries of gaseous matter which form a subset of the symmetries of plasma.

This raises interesting questions about the origins of these patterns in the mind: could they result from spontaneous symmetry breakings in brain activity rather than being genetically encoded?  Darwinian adaptations are genetically encoded, whereas spontaneous symmetry breaking is ubiquitous in nature rather than being limited to genetically constrained structures.  The appeal to spontaneous symmetry breaking suggests a non-Darwinian approach to understanding how the elementary models could be “innate” (in the sense of being neither learned nor arrived at through reason).  That is, are the elementary relational models results of self-organization rather than learning or natural selection?  If they are programmed into the genome, why would this programming imitate a pattern in nature which usually occurs without genetic encoding?  The spiral shape of a galaxy, for example, is due to spontaneous symmetry breaking, as is the transition from liquid to solid.  But these transitions are not encoded in genes, of course.  Being part of the natural world, why should the elementary models be understood any differently?

d. Compound Models

While all relational models are analyzable into four fundamental models, the number of models as such is potentially infinite.  This is because social-relational cognition is productive; any instance of a model can serve as a constituent in an even more complex instance of a model.  Consider Authority Ranking and Market Pricing; an instance of one can be embedded in or subordinated to an instance of the other.  When a judge decides on a punishment that is proportionate to the crime, the judge is using a ratio scale and hence Market Pricing.  But the judge is only authorized to do this because of her authority, hence Authority Ranking.  We have here a case of Market Pricing embedded in a superordinate (as opposed to subordinate) structure of Authority Ranking resulting in a compound model.  Now consider ordering food from a waiter.  The superordinate relationship is now Market Pricing, since one is paying for the waiter’s service.  But the service itself is Authority Ranking with the customer as the superior party.  In this case, an instance of Authority Ranking is subordinate to an instance of Market Pricing.  This is also a compound model with the same constituents but differently arranged.  The democratic election of a leader is Authority Ranking subordinated to Equality Matching.  An elementary school teacher’s supervising children to make sure they take turns is Equality Matching subordinated to Authority Ranking.

A model can also be embedded in a model of the same type.  In some complex egalitarian social arrangements, one instance of Equality Matching can be embedded in another.  Anton Pannekoek’s proposed Council Communism is one such example.  The buying and selling of options is the buying and selling of the right to buy and sell, hence recursively embedded Market Pricing.  Moose society is largely structured by a complex model involving multiple levels of Communal Sharing.  A family among the Moose is largely structured by Communal Sharing, as is the village which embeds it, as is the larger community that embeds the village, and so on.  In principle, there is no upper limit on the number of embeddings in a compound model.  Hence, the number of potential relational models is infinite.

e. Mods and Preos

A model, whether elementary or compound, is devoid of meaning when considered in isolation.  As purely abstract structures, models are sometimes known as “mods” , which is an abbreviation of, “cognitively modular but modifiable modes of interacting” (Fiske 2004, 3).  (This may be a misnomer, since, as purely formal structures devoid of semantic content, mods are not modes of social interaction any more than syntax.   is a communication system.)  In order to externalize models, that is, in order to use them to interpret or motivate or structure interactions, one needs “preos,” these being “socially transmitted prototypes, precedents, and principles that complete the mods, specifying how, when and with respect to whom the mods apply” (2004, 4).  Strictly speaking, a relational model is the union of a mod with a preo.  A mod has the formal properties of symmetry, asymmetry, and in some cases embeddedness.  But a mod requires a preo in order to have the properties intuitively identifiable as meaningful, such as social application, emotional resonance, and motivating force.

The notion of a preo updates and includes the notion of an implementation rule, from an earlier stage of relational-models theorizing.  Fiske has identified five kinds of implementation rules (1991, 142).  One kind specifies the domain to which a model applies.  For example, in some cultures Authority Ranking is used to structure and give meaning to marriage.  In other cultures, Authority Ranking does not structure marriage and may even be viewed as immoral in that context.  Another sort of implementation rule specifies the individuals or groups which are to be related by the model.  Communal Sharing, for example, can be applied to different groups of people.  Experience, and sometimes also agreement, decides who is in the Communal Sharing group.  In implementing Authority Ranking, it is not enough to specify how many ranks there are.  One must also specify who belongs to which rank.  A third sort of implementation rule defines values and categories.  In Equality Matching, each participant must give or receive the same thing.  But what counts as the same thing?  In Authority Ranking, a higher-up deserves honor from a lower-down, but what counts as honor and what constitutes showing honor?  There are no a priori or innate answers to these questions; culture and mutual agreement help settle such matters.  Consider the principle of one-person/one-vote, an example of Equality Matching.  Currently in the United States and Great Britain, whoever gets the most votes wins the election.  But it is also possible to have a system in which a two-thirds majority is necessary for there to be a winner.  Without a two-thirds majority, there may be a coalition government, a second election with the lowest performing candidates eliminated, or some other arrangement.  These are different ways of determining what counts as treating each citizen as having an equal say.  A fourth determines the code used to indicate the existence and quality of the relationship.  Authority Ranking is coded differently in different cultures, as it can be represented by the size of one’s office, the height of one’s throne, the number of bars on one’s sleeve, and so forth.  A fifth sort of implementation rule concerns a general tendency to favor some elementary models over others.  For example, Market Pricing may be highly valued in some cultures as fair and reasonable while categorized as dehumanizing in others.  The same is clearly true of Authority Ranking.  Communal Sharing is much more prominent and generally valued in some cultures than in others.  This does not mean that any culture is completely devoid of any specific elementary model but that some models are de-emphasized and marginalized in some cultures as compared to others.  So the union of mod and preo may even serve to marginalize the resulting model in relation to other models.

The fact that the same mod can be united with different preos is one source of normative plurality across cultures, to be discussed in the next section.  Another source is the generation of distinct compound mods.  Different cultures can use different mods, since there is a considerable number of potential mods to choose from.

2. Philosophical Implications

a. Moral Psychology

Each elementary model crucially enters into certain moral values.  An ethic of service to one’s group is a form of Communal Sharing.  It is an altruistic ethic in some sense, but bear in mind that all members of the group share a common identity.  So, strictly speaking, it is not true altruism.  Authority Ranking informs an ethic of obedience to authority including respect, honor, and loyalty.  Any questions of value remaining to be clarified are settled by the authority; subordinates are expected to follow the values thus dictated.  Fairness and even distribution are informed by Equality Matching.  John Rawls’ veil of ignorance exemplifies Equality Matching; a perspective in which one does not know which role one will play guarantees that one aim for equality.  Gregory Vlastos has even attempted to reduce all distributive justice to a framework that can be identified with Equality Matching.  Market Pricing informs libertarian values of freely entering into contracts and taking risks with the aim of increasing one’s own utility or the utility of one’s group.  But this also includes suffering the losses when one’s calculations prove incorrect.  Utilitarianism is a somewhat counterintuitive attempt to extend this sort of morality to all sentient life, but is still recognizable as Market Pricing.  It would be too simple, however, to say that there are only four sorts of values in RMT.  In fact, combinations of models yield complex models, resulting in a potential infinity of complex values.  Potential variety is further increased by the variability of possible preos.  This great variety of values leads to value conflicts most noticeably across cultures.

RMT strongly suggests value pluralism, in Isaiah Berlin’s sense of “pluralism”.  The pluralism in question is a cultural pluralism, different traditions producing mutually incommensurable values.  Berlin drew a distinction between relativism and pluralism, even though there are strong similarities between the two.  Relativism and pluralism both acknowledge values which are incommensurable, meaning that they cannot be reconciled and that there is no absolute or objective way to judge between them.  Pluralism, however, acknowledges empathy and emotional understanding across cultures.  Even if one does not accept the values of another culture, one still has an emotional understanding of how such values could be adopted.  This stands in contrast to relativism, as defined by Berlin.  If relativism is true, then there can be no emotional understanding of alien values.  One understands the value system of an alien culture in essentially the same manner as one understands the behavior of ants or, for that matter, the behavior of tectonic plates; it is a purely causal understanding.  It is the emotionally remote understanding of the scientist rather than the empathic understanding of someone engaging, say, with the poetry and theatre of another culture.  Adopting RMT, pluralism seems quite plausible.  Given that one has the mental capacity to generate the relevant model, one can replicate the alien value in oneself.  One is not simply thinking about the foreigner’s relational model, but using one’s shared human nature to produce that same model in oneself.  This does not, however, mean that one adopts that value, since one can also retain the conflicting model characteristic of one’s own culture.  One’s decisive motivation may still flow wholly from the latter.

But the significance of RMT for the debate over pluralism and absolutism may be more complex than indicated above.  Since RMT incorporates the view that people perceive social relationships as intrinsic values, this may indicate that a society which fosters interactions and relationships is absolutely better than one which divides and atomizes, at least along that one dimension.  This may be an element of moral absolutism in RMT, and it is interesting to see how it is to be reconciled with any pluralism also implied.

b. Computational Conceptions of Cognition

The examples of embedding in Section 1.d. not only illustrate the productivity of social-relational cognition, but also its systematicity.  To speak of the systematicity of thought means that the ability to think a given thought renders probable the ability to think a semantically close thought.  The ability to conceive of Authority Ranking embedding Market Pricing makes it highly likely that one can conceive of Market Pricing embedding Authority Ranking.  One finds productivity and systematicity in language as well.  Any phrase can be embedded in a superordinate phrase.  For example, the determiner phrase [the water] is embedded in the prepositional phrase [in [the water]], and the prepositional phrase [in [the water]] is embedded in the determiner phrase [the fish [in [the water]]].  The in-principle absence of limit here means that the number of phrases is infinite.  Further, the ability to parse (or understand) a phrase renders very probable the ability to parse (or understand) a semantically close phrase.  For example, being able to mentally process Plato did trust Socrates makes it likely that one can process Socrates did trust Plato as well as Plato did trust Plato and Socrates did trust Socrates.  Productivity and systematicity, either in language or in social-relational cognition, constitute a strong inductive argument for a combinatorial operation that respects semantic relations.  (The operation respects semantic relations, given that the meaning of a generated compound is a function of the meanings of its constituents and their arrangement.)  In other words, it is an argument for digital computation.

This is essentially Noam Chomsky’s argument for a computational procedure explaining syntax (insofar as syntax is not idiomatic).  It is also essentially Jerry Fodor’s argument for computational procedures constituting thought processes more generally.  That digital computation underlies both complex social-relational cognition and language raises important questions.  Are all mental processes largely computational or might language and social-relational cognition be special cases?  Do language and social-relational cognition share the same computational mechanism or do they each have their own?  What are the constraints on computation in either language or social-relational cognition?

c. Platonism

Chomsky has noted the discrete infinity of language.  Each phrase consists of a number of constituents which can be counted using natural numbers (discreteness), and there is no longest phrase meaning that the set of all possible phrases is infinite.  Analogous points apply to social-relational cognition.  The number of instances of an elementary mod within any mod can be counted using natural numbers.  In the case discussed earlier in which a customer is ordering food from a waiter, there is one instance of Authority Ranking embedded in one instance of Market Pricing.  The total number of instances is two, a natural number.  There is no principled upper limit on the number of embeddings, hence infinity.  The discrete infinity of language and social-relational cognition is tantamount to their productivity.

However, some philosophers, especially Jerrold Katz, have argued that nothing empirical can exhibit discrete infinity.  Something empirical may be continuously infinite, such as a volume of space containing infinitely many points.  But the indefinite addition of constituent upon constituent has no empirical exemplification.  Space-time, if it were finite in this sense, would contain only finite energy and a finite number of particles.  There are not infinitely many objects, as discrete infinity would imply.  On this reasoning, the discrete infinity of an entity can only mean that the entity exists beyond space and time, still assuming that space-time is finite.  This would mean that sentences, and by similar reasoning compound mods as well, are abstract objects rather than neural features or processes.  This would mean that mods and sentences are abstract objects like numbers.  One finds here a kind of Platonism, Platonism here defined as the view that there are abstract objects.

As a tentative reply, one could say that the symbols generated by a computational system are potentially infinite in number, but this raises questions about the nature of potentiality.  What is a merely potential mod or a merely potential sentence?  It is not something with any spatiotemporal location or any causal power.  Perhaps it is sentence types (as contrasted with tokens) that exhibit discrete infinity.  And likewise with mods, it is mod types that exhibit discrete infinity.  But here too, one is appealing to entities, namely types, that have no spatiotemporal location or causal power.  By definition, these are abstract objects.

The case for Platonism is perhaps stronger for compound mods, but one could also defend the same conclusion with regard to the elementary mods.  Each elementary mod, as noted earlier, corresponds to one of the classic measurement scales.  Different scale types are presupposed by different logics.  Classical two-valued logic presupposes a nominal scale, as illustrated by the law of excluded middle: a statement is either on the truth scale, in which case it is true, or off the scale, in which case it is false.  Alternatively, one could posit two categories, one for true and one for false, and stipulate that any statement belongs on one scale or the other.  Fuzzy logics conceive truth either in terms of interval scales, for example, it is two degrees more true that Michel is bald than that Van is bald, or in terms of ratio scales, for example, it is 80 percent true that Van is bald, 100 percent true that Michel is bald.  Even though it has perhaps not been formalized, there is intuitively a logic which presupposes an ordinal scale.  A logic, say,  in which it is more true that chess is a game than that Ring a Ring o’ Roses is a game, even though it would be meaningless to ask how much more.  If nominal, ordinal, interval, and ratio scales are more basic than various logics, then the question arises as to whether they can seriously be considered empirical or spatiotemporal.  If anything is Platonic, then something more basic than logic is likely to be Platonic.  And what is an elementary mod aside from the scale type which it “resembles”?  Is there any reason to distinguish the elementary mod from the scale type itself?  If not, then the elementary mods themselves are abstract objects, at least on this argument.

Does reflection upon language and the relational models support a Platonist metaphysic?  If so, what is one to make of the earlier discussion of RMT appealing, as it did, to neural symmetry breakings and mental computations?  If mods are abstract objects, then the symmetry breakings and computations may belong to the epistemology of RMT rather than to its metaphysics.  In other words, they may throw light on how one knows about mods rather than actually constituting the mods themselves.  Specifically, the symmetry breaking and computations may account for the production of mental representations of mods rather than the mods themselves.  But whether or not there is a good case here for Platonism is, no doubt, open to further questioning.

3. References

a. Specifically Addressing Relational Models Theory

  • Bolender, John. (2010), The Self-Organizing Social Mind (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press).
    • Argues that the elementary relational models are due to self-organizing brain activity.  Also contains a discussion of possible Platonist implications of RMT.
  • Bolender, John. (2011), Digital Social Mind (Exeter, UK: Imprint Academic).
    • Argues that complex relational models are due to mental computations.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1990), “Relativity within Moose (‘Mossi’) culture: four incommensurable models for social relationships,” Ethos, 18, pp. 180-204.
    • Fiske here argues that RMT supports moral relativism, although his “relativism” may be the same as Berlin’s “pluralism.”
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1991), Structures of Social Life: The Four Elementary Forms of Human Relations (New York: The Free Press).
    • The classic work on RMT, containing the first full statement of the theory and a wealth of anthropological illustrations.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1992), “The Four Elementary Forms of Sociality: Framework for a Unified Theory of Social Relations,” Psychological Review, 99, 689-723.
    • Essentially, a shorter version of Fiske’s (1991).  Nonetheless, this is a detailed and substantial introduction to RMT.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (2004), “Relational Models Theory 2.0,” in Haslam (2004a).
    • An updated introduction to RMT.
  • Haslam, Nick. ed. (2004a), Relational Models Theory: A Contemporary Overview (Mahwah, New Jersey and London: Lawrence Erlbaum).
    • An anthology containing an updated introduction to RMT as well as discussions of controlled empirical evidence supporting the theory.
  • Haslam, Nick. ed. (2004b), “Research on the Relational Models: An Overview,” in Haslam (2004a).
    • Reviews controlled studies corroborating that the elementary relational models play an important role in cognition including person perception.
  • Pinker, Steven. (2007), The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature (London: Allen Lane).
    • Argues that Market Pricing, in contrast to the other three elementary models, is not innate and is somehow unnatural.

b. Related Issues

  • Berlin, Isaiah. (1990), The Crooked Timber of Humanity: Chapters in the History of Ideas. Edited by H. Hardy (London: Pimlico).
    • A discussion of value pluralism in the context of history of ideas.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. (1987), Psychosemantics: The Problem of Meaning in the Philosophy of Mind (Cambridge, Mass. and London: MIT Press).
    • The Appendix argues that systematicity and productivity in thought require a combinatorial system.  The point, however, is a general one, not specifically focused on social-relational cognition.
  • Katz, Jerrold J. (1996), “The unfinished Chomskyan revolution,” Mind & Language, 11 (3), pp. 270-294.
    • Argues that only an abstract object can exhibit discrete infinity.
  • Rawls, John. (1971), A Theory of Justice (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press).
    • The veil of ignorance illustrates Equality Matching.
  • Szpiro, George G. (2010), Numbers Rule: The Vexing Mathematics of Democracy, from Plato to the Present (Princeton: Princeton University Press).
    • Illustrates various ways in which Equality Matching can be implemented.
  • Stevens, S. S. (1946), “On the Theory of Scales of Measurement,” Science 103, pp. 677-680.
    • A classic discussion of the types of measurement scales.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. (1962), “Justice and Equality,” in Richard B. Brandt, ed. Social Justice (Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice-Hall).
    • An attempt to understand all distributive justice in terms of Equality Matching.

Author Information

John Bolender
Middle East Technical University

Jerry A. Fodor (1935— )

J. FodorJerry Fodor is one of the principal philosophers of mind of the late twentieth and early twenty-first century. In addition to having exerted an enormous influence on virtually every portion of the philosophy of mind literature since 1960, Fodor’s work has had a significant impact on the development of the cognitive sciences. In the 1960s, along with Hilary Putnam, Noam Chomsky, and others, he put forward influential criticisms of the behaviorism that dominated much philosophy and psychology at the time. Since then, Fodor has articulated and defended an alternative, realist conception of intentional states and their content that he argues vindicates the core elements of folk psychology within a physicalist framework.

Fodor has developed two theories that have been particularly influential across disciplinary boundaries. He defends a “Representational Theory of Mind,” according to which mental states are computational relations that organisms bear to mental representations that are physically realized in the brain. On Fodor’s view, these mental representations are internally structured much like sentences in a natural language, in that they have both syntactic structure and a compositional semantics. Fodor also defends an influential hypothesis about mental architecture, namely, that low-level sensory systems (and language) are “modular,” in the sense that they’re “informationally encapsulated” from the higher-level “central” systems responsible for belief formation, decision-making, and the like. Fodor’s work on modularity has been especially influential among evolutionary psychologists, who go much further than Fodor in claiming that the systems underlying even high-level cognition are modular, a view that Fodor himself vehemently resists.

Fodor has also defended a number of other influential views. He was an early proponent of the claim that mental properties are functional properties, defined by their role in a cognitive system and not by the physical material that constitutes them. Alongside functionalism, Fodor defended an early and influential version of non-reductive physicalism, according to which mental properties are realized by, but not reducible to, physical properties of the brain. Fodor has also long been a staunch defender of nativism about the structure and contents of the human mind, arguing against a variety of empiricist theories and famously arguing that all lexical concepts are innate. When it comes to a theory of concepts, Fodor has vigorously argued against all versions of inferential role semantics in philosophy and psychology. Fodor’s own view is what he calls “informational atomism,” according to which lexical concepts are internally unstructured and have their content in virtue of standing in certain external, “informational” relations to properties instantiated in the environment.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Physicalism, Functionalism, and the Special Sciences
  3. Intentional Realism
  4. The Representational Theory of Mind
  5. Content and Concepts
  6. Nativism
  7. Modularity
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Jerry Fodor was born in New York City in 1935. He received his A.B. from Columbia University in 1956 and his Ph.D. from Princeton University in 1960. His first academic position was at MIT, where he taught in the Departments of Philosophy and Psychology until 1986. He was Distinguished Professor at CUNY Graduate Center from 1986 to 1988, when he moved to Rutgers University where he has remained ever since. He is currently the State of New Jersey Professor of Philosophy and Cognitive Science.

2. Physicalism, Functionalism, and the Special Sciences

Throughout his career Fodor has subscribed to physicalism, the claim that all the genuine particulars and properties in the world are either identical to or in some sense determined by and dependent upon physical particulars and properties. Although there are many questions about how physicalism should be formulated and understood—for instance, what “physical” means and whether the relevant determination/dependency relation is “supervenience” (Kim 1993) or “realization” (Melnyk 2003, Shoemkaer 2007)—there’s widespread acceptance of some or other version of physicalism among philosophers of mind. To accept physicalism is to deny that psychological and other non-basic properties “float free” from the fundamental physical properties. Thus, acceptance of physicalism  goes hand in hand with a rejection of mind-body dualism.

Some of Fodor’s early work (1968, 1975) aimed (i) to show that “mentalism” was a genuine alternative to dualism and behaviorism, (ii) to show that behaviorism had a number of serious shortcomings, (iii) to defend functionalism as the appropriate physicalist metaphysics underlying mentalism, and (iv) to defend a conception of psychology and other special sciences according to which higher-level laws and the properties that figure in them are irreducible to lower-level laws and properties. Let’s consider each of these in turn.


For much of the twentieth century, behaviorism was widely regarded as the only viable physicalist alternative to dualism. Fodor helped to change that, in part by drawing a clear distinction between mere mentalism, which posits the existence of internal, causally efficacious mental states, and dualism, which is mentalism plus the view that mental events require a special kind of substance. Here’s Fodor in his classic book Psychological Explanation:

[P]hilosophers who have wanted to banish the ghost from the machine have usually sought to do so by showing that truths about behavior can sometimes, and in some sense, logically implicate truths about mental states. In so doing, they have rather strongly suggested that the exorcism can be carried through only if such a logical connection can be made out. … [O]nce it has been made clear that the choice between dualism and behaviorism is not exhaustive, a major motivation for the defense of behaviorism is removed: we are not required to be behaviorists simply in order to avoid being dualists” (1968, pp. 58-59).

Fodor thus argues that there’s a middle road between dualism and behaviorism. Attributing mental states to organisms in explaining how they get around in and manipulate their environments need not involve the postulation of a mental substance different in kind from physical bodies and brains. In Fodor’s view, behaviorists influenced by Wittgenstein and Ryle ignored the distinction between mentalism and dualism—as he puts it, “confusing mentalism with dualism is the original sin of the Wittgensteinian tradition” (Fodor, 1975, p. 4).

In addition to clearly distinguishing mentalism from dualism, Fodor put forward a number of trenchant objections to behaviorism and the various arguments for it. He argued, for instance, that neither knowing about the mental states of others nor learning a language with mental terms requires that there be a logical connection, that is, a deductively valid connection, between mental and behavioral terms, thus undermining a number of epistemological and linguistic arguments for behaviorism (Fodor and Chihara 1965, Fodor 1968). Perhaps more importantly, Fodor argued that theories in cognitive psychology and linguistics provide a powerful argument against behaviorism, since they posit the existence of various mental events that are not definable in terms of, or otherwise logically connected to, overt behavior (Fodor 1968, 1975). Along with the arguments of Putnam (1963, 1967) and Chomsky (1959), among others, Fodor’s early arguments against behaviorism were an important step in the development of the then emerging cognitive sciences.

Central to this development was the rise of functionalism as a genuine alternative to behaviorism, and Fodor’s Psychological Explanation (1968) was one of the first in-depth treatments and defenses of this view (see also Putnam 1963, 1967). Unlike behaviorism, which attempts to explain behavior in terms of law-like relationships between stimulus inputs and behavioral outputs, functionalism posits that such explanations will appeal to internal properties that mediate between inputs and outputs. Indeed, the main claim of functionalism is that mental properties are individuated in terms of the various causal relations they enter into, where such relations are not restricted to mere input-output relations, but also include their relations to a host of other properties that figure in the relevant empirical theories. Although, at the time, the distinctions between various forms of functionalism weren’t as clear as they are now, Fodor’s brand of functionalism is a version of what is now known as “psycho-functionalism”. On this view, what determines the relations that define mental properties are the deliverances of empirical psychology, and not, say, the platitudes of commonsense psychology, what can be known a priori about mental properties, or the analyticities expressive of the meanings of mental expressions; see Rey (1997, ch.7) and Shoemaker (2003) for discussion.

By defining mental properties in terms of their causal roles, functionalists allow for different kinds of physical phenomena to satisfy these relations. Functionalism thus goes hand in hand with multiple realizability. In other words, if a given mental property, M, is a functional property that’s defined by a specific causal condition, C, then any number of distinct physical properties, P1, P2, P3… Pn, may each “realize” M provided that each property meets C. Functionalism thereby characterizes mental properties at a level of abstraction that ignores differences in the physical structure of the systems that have these properties. Early functionalists, like Fodor and Putnam, thus took themselves to be articulating a position that was distinct not only from behaviorism, but also from type-identity theory, which identifies mental properties with neurophysiological properties of the brain. If functionalism implies that mental properties can be realized by different physical properties in different kinds of systems (or the same system over time), then functionalism precludes identifying mental properties with physical properties.

Fodor’s functionalism, in particular, was articulated so that it was seen to have sweeping consequences for debates concerning reductionism and the unity of science. In his seminal essay “Special Sciences” (1974), Fodor spells out a metaphysical picture of the special sciences that eventually came to be called “non-reductive physicalism”. This picture is physicalist in that it accepts what Fodor calls the “generality of physics,” which is the claim that every event that falls under a special science predicate also falls under a physical predicate, but not vice versa. It’s non-reductionist in that it denies that “the special sciences should reduce to physical theories in the long run” (1974, p. 97). Traditionally, reductionists sought to articulate bridge laws that link special science predicates with physical predicates, either in the form of bi-conditionals or identity statements. Fodor argues not only that the generality of physics does not require the existence of bridge laws, but that in general such laws will be unavailable given that the events picked out by special science predicates will be “wildly disjunctive” from the perspective of physics (1974, p. 103). Multiple realizability thus guarantees that special science predicates will cross-classify phenomena picked out by purely physical predicates. This, in turn, undermines the reductionist hope of a unified science whereby the higher-level theories of the special sciences reduce to lower-level theories and ultimately to fundamental physics. On Fodor’s picture, then, the special sciences are “autonomous” in that they articulate irreducible generalizations that quantify over irreducible and casually efficacious higher-level properties (1974; see also 1998b, ch.2).

Functionalism and non-reductive physicalism are now commonplace in philosophy of mind, and provide the backdrop for many contemporary debates about psychological explanation, laws, multiple realizability, mental causation, and more. This is something for which Fodor surely deserves much of the credit (or blame, depending on one’s view; see Kim (1993) and Heil (2003) for criticisms of the metaphysical underpinnings of non-reductive physicalism).

3. Intentional Realism

A central aim of Fodor’s work has been to defend folk psychology as at least the starting point for a serious scientific psychology. At a minimum, folk psychology is committed to two kinds of states: belief-like states, which represent the environment and guide one’s behavior, and desire-like states, which represent one’s goals and motivate behavior. We routinely appeal to such states in our common-sense explanations of people’s behavior.  For example, we explain why John walked to the store in terms of his desire for milk and his belief that there’s milk for sale at the store. Fodor is impressed by the remarkable predictive power of such belief-desire explanations. The following passage is typical:

Common sense psychology works so well it disappears. It’s like those mythical Rolls Royce cars whose engines are sealed when they leave the factory; only it’s better because they aren’t mythical. Someone I don’t know phones me at my office in New York from—as it might be—Arizona. ‘Would you like to lecture here next Tuesday?’ are the words he utters. ‘Yes thank you. I’ll be at your airport on the 3 p.m. flight’ are the words that I reply. That’s all that happens, but it’s more than enough; the rest of the burden of predicting behavior—of bridging the gap between utterances and actions—is routinely taken up by the theory. And the theory works so well that several days later (or weeks later, or months later, or years later; you can vary the example to taste) and several thousand miles away, there I am at the airport and there he is to meet me. Or if I don’t turn up, it’s less likely that the theory failed than that something went wrong with the airline. … The theory from which we get this extraordinary predictive power is just good old common sense belief/desire psychology. … If we could do that well with predicting the weather, no one would ever get his feet wet; and yet the etiology of the weather must surely be child’s play compared with the causes of behavior. (1987, pp. 3-4)

Passages like this may suggest that Fodor’s intentional realism is wedded to the folk-psychological categories of “belief” and “desire”. But this isn’t so. Rather, Fodor’s claim is that there are certain core elements of folk psychology that will be shared by a mature scientific psychology. In particular, a mature psychology will posit states with the following features:

(1)  They will be intentional: they will be “about” things and they will be semantically evaluable. (In the way that the belief that Obama is President is about Obama, and can be semantically evaluated as true or false.)

(2)  They will be causally efficacious, figuring in genuine causal explanations and laws.

Fodor’s intentional realism thus doesn’t require that the folk-psychological categories themselves find a place in a mature psychology. Indeed, Fodor has suggested that the individuation conditions for beliefs are “so vague and pragmatic” that it’s doubtful they’re fit for empirical psychology (1990, p. 175). What Fodor is committed to is the claim that a mature psychology will be intentional through and through, and that the intentional states it posits will be causally implicated in law-like explanations of human behavior. Exactly which intentional states will figure in a mature psychology is a matter to be decided by empirical inquiry, not by a priori reflection on our common sense understanding.

Fodor’s defense of intentional realism is usefully viewed as part of a rationalist tradition that stresses the human mind’s striking sensitivity to indefinitely many arbitrary properties of the world. We’re sensitive not only to abstract properties such as being a democracy and being virtuous, but also to abstract grammatical properties such as being a noun phrase and being a verb phrase, as well as to such arbitrary properties as being a tiny folded piece of paper, being an oddly-shaped canteen, being a crumpled shirt, and being to the left of my favorite mug. On Fodor’s view, something can selectively respond to such properties only if it’s an intentional system capable of manipulating representations of these properties.

Of course, there are many physical systems that are responsive to environmental properties ( thermometers, paramecia) that we would not wish to count as intentional systems. Fodor’s own proposal for what distinguishes intentional systems from the rest is that only intentional systems are sensitive to “non-nomic” properties, that is, the properties of objects that do not determine that they fall under any laws of nature (Fodor 1986). Consider Fodor’s example of the property of being a crumpled shirt. Although laws govern crumpled shirts, no object is subsumed under a law in virtue of being a crumpled shirt. Nevertheless, the property of being a crumpled shirt is one that we can represent an object as having, and such representations do enter into laws of nature. For instance, there’s presumably a law-like relationship between my noticing the crumpled shirt, my desire to remark upon it, and my saying “there’s a crumpled shirt”. On Fodor’s view the job of intentional psychology is to articulate the laws governing mental representations, which figure in genuine causal explanations of people’s behavior (Fodor 1987, 1998a).

Although positing mental representations that have semantic and causal properties— states that satisfy (1) and (2) above—may not seem particularly controversial, the existence of causally efficacious intentional states has been denied by all manner of behaviorists, epiphenomenalists, Wittgensteinians, interpretationists, instrumentalists, and (at least some) connectionists. Much of Fodor’s work has been devoted to defending intentional realism against such views as they have arisen in both philosophy and psychology. In addition to defending intentional realism against the behaviorism of Skinner and Ryle (Fodor 1968, 1975, Fodor et al. 1974), Fodor has also defended it against the threat of epiphenomenalism (Fodor 1989), against Wittgenstein and other defenders of the “private language argument” (Fodor and Chihara 1965, Fodor 1975), against the eliminativism of the Churchlands (Fodor 1987, 1990), against the instrumentalism of Dennett (Fodor 1981a, Fodor and Lepore 1992), against the interpretationism of Davidson (Fodor 1990, Fodor and Lepore 1992, Fodor 2004), and against certain versions of connectionism (Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988, Fodor and McLaughlin 1990, Fodor 1998b).

Even if Fodor is right that there are intentional states that satisfy (1) and (2), there’s still the question of how such states can exist in a physical world. Intentional realists must explain, for instance, how lawful relations between intentional states can be understood physicalistically. This is particularly pressing, since at least some intentional laws describe rational relations between the intentional states they quantify over, and, ever since Descartes, philosophers have worried about how a purely physical system could exhibit rational relations (see Lowe (2008) for recent skepticism from a non-Cartesian dualist). Fodor’s Representational Theory of Mind is his attempt to answer such worries.

4. The Representational Theory of Mind

As Fodor points out, RTM is “really a loose confederation of theses” that “lacks, to put it mildly, a canonical formulation” (1998a, p. 6). At its core, though, RTM is an attempt to combine Alan Turing’s work on computation with intentional realism (as outlined above). Broadly speaking, RTM claims that mental processes are computational processes, and that intentional states are relations to mental representations that serve as the domain of such processes. On Fodor’s version of RTM, these mental representations have both syntactic structure and a compositional semantics. Thinking thus takes place in an internal language of thought.

Turing showed us how to construct a purely mechanical device that could transform syntactically-individuated symbols in such a way as to respect the semantic relations that exist between the meanings, or contents, of those symbols. Formally valid inferences are the paradigm. For instance, modus ponens can be realized on a machine that’s sensitive only to syntactic properties of symbols. The device thus doesn’t have “access” to the symbols’ semantic properties, but can nevertheless transform the symbols in a truth-preserving way. What’s interesting about this, from Fodor’s perspective, is that, at least sometimes, mental processes also involve chains of thoughts that are truth-preserving. As Fodor puts it:

[I]f you start out with a true thought, and you proceed to do some thinking, it is very often the case that the thoughts that thinking leads you to will also be true. This is, in my view, the most important fact we know about minds; no doubt it’s why God bothered to give us any. (1994, p. 9; see also 1987, pp. 12-14, 2000, p. 18)

In order to account for this “most important” fact, RTM claims that thoughts themselves are syntactically-structured representations, and that mental processes are computational processes defined over them. Given that the syntax of a representation is what determines its causal role in thought, RTM thereby serves to connect the fact that mental processes are truth-preserving with the fact that they’re causal.

For instance, suppose a thinker believes that if John ran, then Mary swam. According to RTM, for a thinker to hold such a belief is for the thinker to stand in a certain computational relation to a mental representation that means if John ran, then Mary swam. Now suppose the thinker comes to believe that John ran, and as a result comes to believe that Mary swam. RTM has it that the causal relations between these thoughts hold in virtue of the syntactic form of the underlying mental representations. By picturing the mind as a “syntax-driven machine” (Fodor, 1987, p. 20), RTM thus promises to explain how the causal relations among thoughts can respect rational relations among their contents. It thereby provides a potentially promising reply to Descartes’ worry about how rationality could be exhibited by a mere machine. As Fodor puts it:

So we can now (maybe) explain how thinking could be both rational and mechanical. Thinking can be rational because syntactically specified operations can be truth preserving insofar as they reconstruct relations of logical form; thinking can be mechanical because Turing machines are machines. … [T]his really is a lovely idea and we should pause for a moment to admire it. Rationality is a normative property; that is, it’s one that a mental process ought to have. This is the first time that there has ever been a remotely plausible mechanical theory of the causal powers of a normative property. The first time ever. (2000, p. 29)

In Fodor’s view, it’s a major argument in favor of RTM that it promises an explanation of how mental processes can be truth-preserving (Fodor 1994, p. 9; 2000, p. 13), and a major strike against traditional empiricist and associationist theories that they offer no competing explanation (1998a, p. 10; 2000, pp. 15-18; 2003, pp. 90-94).

That it explains how truth-preserving mental processes could be realized causally is one of Fodor’s main arguments for RTM. In addition, Fodor argues that RTM provides the only hope of explaining the so-called “productivity” and “systematicity” of thought (Fodor 1987, 1998a, 2008). Roughly, productivity is the feature of our minds whereby there is no upper bound to the number of thoughts we can entertain. We can think that the dog is on the deck; that the dog, which chased the squirrel, is on the deck; that the dog, which chased the squirrel, which foraged for nuts, is on the deck; and so on, indefinitely. There are, of course, thoughts whose contents are so long that other factors prevent us from entertaining them. But abstracting away from such performance limitations, it seems that a theory of our conceptual competence must account for such productivity. Thought also appears to be systematic, in the following sense: a mind that is capable of entertaining a certain thought, p, is also capable of entertaining logical permutations of p. For example, minds that can entertain the thought that the book is to the left of the cup can also entertain the thought that the cup is to the left of the book. Although it’s perhaps possible that there could be minds that  do not exhibit such systematicity—a possibility denied by some, for example, Evans (1982) and Peacocke (1992)—it at least appears to be an empirical fact that all minds do.

In Fodor’s view, RTM is the only theory of mind that can explain productivity and systematicity. According to RTM, mental states have internal, constituent structure, and the content of mental states is determined by the content of their constituents and how those constituents are put together. Given a finite base of primitive representations, our capacity to entertain endlessly many thoughts can be explained by positing a finite number of rules for combining representations, which can be applied endlessly many times in the course of constructing complex thoughts. RTM offers a similar explanation of systematicity. The reason that a mind that can entertain the thought that the book is to the left of the cup can also entertain the thought that the cup is to the left of the book, is that these thoughts are built up out of the same constituents, using the same rules of combination. RTM thus explains productivity and systematicity because it claims that mental states are relations to representations that have syntactic structure and a compositional semantics. One of Fodor’s main arguments against alternative, connectionist theories is that they fail to account for such features (Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988, Fodor 1998b, chs. 9 and10).

A further argument Fodor offers in favor of RTM is that successful empirical theories of various non-demonstrative inferences presuppose a system of internal representations in which such inferences are carried out. For instance, standard theories of visual perception attempt to explain how a percept is constructed on the basis of the physical information available and the visual system’s built-in assumptions about the environment, or “natural constraints” (Pylyshyn 2003). Similarly, theories of sentence perception and comprehension require that the language system be able to represent distinct properties (for instance, acoustic, phonological, and syntactic properties) of a single utterance (Fodor et al. 1974). Both sorts of theories require that there be a system of representations capable of representing various properties and serving as the medium in which such inferences are carried out. Indeed, Fodor sometimes claims that the best reason for endorsing RTM is that “some version or other of RTM underlies practically all current psychological research on mentation, and our best science is ipso facto our best estimate of what there is and what it’s made of” (Fodor 1987, p. 17). Fodor’s The Language of Thought (1975) is the locus classicus of this style of argument.

5. Content and Concepts

Even if taking mental processes to be computational shows how rational relations between thoughts can be realized by purely casual relations among symbols in the brain, as RTM suggests, there’s still the question of how those symbols come to have their meaning or content. Ever since Brentano, philosophers have worried about how to integrate intentionality into the physical world, a worry that has famously led some to accept the “baselessness of intentional idioms and the emptiness of a science of intention” (Quine 1960, p. 221). Part of Fodor’s task is thus to show, contra his eliminativist, instrumentalist, and interpretationist opponents, that a plausible naturalistic account of intentionality can be given. Much of his work over the last two decades or so has focused on this representational (as opposed to the computational) component of RTM (Fodor 1987, 1994, 1998; Fodor and Lepore 1992, 2002).

Back in the 1960s and early 1970s, Fodor endorsed a version of so-called “inferential role semantics” (IRS), according to which the content of a representation is (partially) determined by the inferential connections that it bears to other representations. To take two hoary examples, IRS has it that “bachelor” gets its meaning, in part, by bearing an inferential connection to “unmarried,” and “kill” gets its meaning, in part, by bearing an inferential connection to “die”. Such inferential connections hold, on Fodor’s early view, because “bachelor” and “kill” have complex structure at the level at which they’re semantically interpreted— that is, they have the structure exhibited by the phrases “unmarried adult male” and “cause to die” (Katz and Fodor 1963). In terms of concepts, the claim is that the concept BACHELOR has the internal structure exhibited by ‘UNMARRIED ADULT MALE’, and the concept KILL has the internal structure exhibited by ‘CAUSE TO DIE’. (This article follows the convention of writing the names of concepts in capitals and writing the meanings of concepts in italics.)

Eventually, Fodor came to think that there are serious objections to IRS. Some of these objections were based on his own experimental work in psycholinguistics, which he took to provide strong evidence against the existence of complex lexical structure. Understanding a sentence does not seem to involve recovering the decompositions of the lexical items they contain (Fodor et al. 1975). Thinking the thought CATS CHASE MICE doesn’t seem to be harder than thinking CATS CATCH MICE, whereas the former ought to be more complex if ‘chase’ can be decomposed into a structure that includes ‘intends to catch’ (Fodor et al. 1980). As Fodor recently quipped, “[i]t’s an iron law of cognitive science that, in experimental environments, definitions always behave exactly as though they weren’t there” (1998a, p. 46). (For an alternative interpretation of this evidence, see Jackendoff (1983, pp. 125-127; 1992, p. 49), and Miller and Johnson-Laird (1976, p. 328).) In part because of the lack of evidence for decompositional structure, Fodor at one point seriously considered the view the inferential connections among lexical items may hold in virtue of inference rules, or “meaning postulates,” which renders IRS consistent with a denial of the claim that lexical items are semantically structured (1975, pp. 148-152).

However, Fodor ultimately became convinced of Quine’s influential arguments against meaning postulates, and more generally, Quine’s view that there is no principled distinction between those connections that are “constitutive” of the meaning of a concept and those that are “merely collateral”. Quinean considerations, Fodor argues, show that IRS theorists should not appeal to meaning postulates (Fodor 1998a, appendix 5a). Moreover, Quine’s confirmation holism suggests that the epistemic properties of a concept are potentially connected to the epistemic properties of every other concept, which, according to Fodor, suggests that IRS inevitably leads to semantic holism, the claim that all of a concept’s inferential connections are constitutive. But Fodor argues that semantic holism is unacceptable, since it’s incompatible with the claim that concepts are shareable. As he recently put it, “since practically everybody has some eccentric beliefs about practically everything, holism has it that nobody shares any concepts with anybody else” (2004, p. 35; see also Fodor and Lepore 1992, Fodor 1998a). This implication would undermine the possibility of genuine intentional generalizations in psychology, which require that concepts are shared across both individuals and different time-slices of the same individual.

Proponents of IRS might reply to these concerns about semantic holism by claiming that only some inferential connections are concept-constitutive. But Fodor suggests that the only way to distinguish the constitutive connections from the rest is to endorse an analytic/synthetic distinction, which in his view Quine has given us good reason to reject (for example, 1990, p. x, 1998a, p. 71, 1998b, pp. 32-33). Fodor’s Quinean point, ultimately, is that theorists should be reluctant to claim that there are certain beliefs people must hold, or inferences they must accept, in order to possess a concept. For thinkers can apparently have any number of arbitrarily strange beliefs involving some concept, consistent with them sharing that concept with others. As Fodor puts it:

[P]eople can have radically false theories and really crazy views, consonant with our understanding perfectly well, thank you, which false views they have and what radically crazy things it is that they believe. Berkeley thought that chairs are mental, for Heaven’s sake! Which are we to say he lacked, the concept MENTAL or the concept CHAIR? (1987, p. 125) (For further reflections along similar lines, see Williamson 2007.)

Without an analytic/synthetic distinction, any attempt to answer such a question would be unprincipled. Rejecting the analytic/synthetic distinction thus leads Fodor to reject any ‘molecularist’ attempt to specify only certain inferences or beliefs as concept-constitutive. On Fodor’s view, then, proponents of IRS are faced with two unequally satisfying options: they can agree with Quine about the analytic/synthetic distinction, but at the cost of endorsing semantic holism and its unpalatable consequences for the viability of intentionality psychology; or they can deny semantic holism at the cost of endorsing an analytic/synthetic distinction, which Fodor thinks nobody knows how to draw.

It’s worth pointing out that Fodor doesn’t think that confirmation holism, all by itself, rules out the existence of certain “local” semantic connections that hold as a matter of empirical fact. Indeed, contemporary battles over the existence of such connections are now taking place on explanatory grounds that involve delicate psychological and linguistic considerations that are fairly far removed from the epistemological considerations that motivated the positivists. For instance, there are the standard convergences in people’s semantic-cum-conceptual intuitions, which cry out for an empirical explanation. Although some argue that such convergences are best explained by positing analyticities ( Grice and Strawson 1956, Rey 2005), Fodor argues that all such intuitions can be accounted for by an appeal to Quinean “centrality” or “one-criterion” concepts (Fodor 1998a, pp. 80-86). There are also considerations in linguistics that bear on the existence of an empirically grounded analytic/synthetic distinction including issues concerning the syntactic and semantic analyses of ‘causative’ verbs, the ‘generativity’ of the lexicon, and the acquisition of certain elements of syntax. Fodor has engaged linguists on a number of such fronts, arguing against the proposals of Jackendoff (1992), Pustejovsky (1995), Pinker (1989), Hale and Keyser (1993), and others, defending the Quinean line (see Fodor 1998a, pp. 49-56, and Fodor and Lepore 2002, chs. 5-6; see Pustejovsky 1998 and Hale and Keyser 1999 for rejoinders). Fodor’s view is that all of the relevant empirical facts about minds and language can be explained without any analytic connections, but merely deeply believed ones, precisely as Quine argued.

Fodor sees a common error to all versions of IRS because they are trying to tie semantics to epistemology. Moreover, the problems plaguing IRS ultimately arise as a result of its attempt to connect a theory of meaning with certain epistemic conditions of thinkers. A further argument against such views, Fodor claims, is that such epistemic conditions do not compose, since they violate the compositionality constraint that is required for an explanation of productivity and systematicity (see above). For instance, if one believes that brown cows are dangerous, then the concept BROWN COW will license the inference ‘BROWN COW → DANGEROUS’; but this inference is not determined by the inferential roles of BROWN and COW, which it ought to be if meaning-constituting inferences are compositional (Fodor and Lepore 2002, ch.1; for discussion and criticism, see, for example, Block 1993, Boghossian 1993, and Rey 1993).

Another epistemic approach, as favored by many psychologists, appeals to “prototypes”. According to these theories, lexical concepts are internally structured and specify the prototypical features of their instances, that is, the features that they’re instances tend to (but need not) have (for examples see Rosch and Mervis 1975). Prototype theories are epistemic accounts because having a concept is a matter of knowing the features of its prototypical instances. Given this, Fodor argues that prototype theories are in danger of violating compositionality. For example, knowing what prototypical pets ('dogs') are like and what prototypical fish ('trout') are like does not guarantee that you know what prototypical pet fish ('goldfish') are like (Fodor 1998a, pp. 102-108, Fodor and Lepore 2002, ch. 2). Since compositionality is required in order to explain the productivity and systematicity of thought, and prototype structures do not compose, it follows that concepts don’t have prototype structure. According to Fodor, the same kind argument applies to theories that take concepts to be individuated by certain recognitional capacities. Fodor argues that since recognitional capacities don’t compose, but concepts do, “there are no recognitional concepts—not even red” (Fodor 1998b, ch. 4). This argument has been disputed by a number of philosophers, for example, Horgan (1998), Recanati (2002), and Prinz (2002).

Fodor thus rejects all theories that individuate concepts in terms of their epistemic relations and their internal structure, and instead defends what he calls “informational atomism,” according to which lexical concepts are unstructured atoms whose content is determined by certain informational relations they bear to phenomena in the environment. In claiming that lexical concepts are internally unstructured, Fodor’s informational atomism is meant to respect the evidence and arguments against decomposition, definitions, prototypes, and the like. In claiming that none of the epistemic properties of concepts are constitutive, Fodor is endorsing what he sees as the only alternative to a molecularist and holistic theory of content, neither of which he takes to be viable. By separating epistemology from semantics in this way, Fodor’s theory places virtually no constraints on what a thinker must believe in order to possess a particular concept. For instance, what determines whether a mind possesses DOG isn’t whether it has certain beliefs about dogs, but rather whether it possess an internal symbol that stands in the appropriate mind-world relation to the property of being a dog. Rather than talking about concepts as they figure in beliefs, inferences, or other epistemic states, Fodor instead talks of mere “tokenings” of concepts, where for him these are internal symbols that need not play any specific role in cognition. In his view, this is the only way for a theory of concepts to respect Quinean strictures on analyticity and constitutive conceptual connections. Indeed, Fodor claims that by denying that “the grasp of any interconceptual relations is constitutive of concept possession,” informational atomism allows us to “see why Quine was right about there not being an analytic/synthetic distinction” (Fodor 1998a, p. 71).

Fodor’s most explicit characterization of the mind-world relation that determines content is his “asymmetry dependency” theory (1987, 1990). According to this theory, the concept DOG means dog because dogs cause tokenings of DOG, and non-dogs causing tokenings of DOG is asymmetrically dependent upon dogs causing DOG. In other words, non-dogs wouldn’t cause tokenings of DOG unless dogs cause tokenings of DOG, but not vice versa. This is Fodor’s attempt to meet Brentano’s challenge of providing a naturalistic sufficient condition for a symbol to have a meaning. Not surprisingly, many objections have been raised to Fodor’s asymmetric dependency theory (seethe papers in Loewer in Rey 1991), and it’s interesting to note that the theory has all but disappeared from his more recent work on concepts and content, in which he simply claims that “meaning is information (more or less)”, without specifying the nature of the relations that determine the informational content of a symbol (1998a, p. 12).

Regardless of the exact nature of the content-determining laws, it’s important to see that Fodor is not claiming that the epistemic properties of concept are irrelevant from the perspective of a theory of concepts. For such epistemic properties are what sustain the laws that “lock” concepts onto properties in the environment. For instance, it is only because thinkers know a range of facts about dogs—what they look like, that they bark, and so forth—that their dog-tokens are lawfully connected to the property of being a dog. Knowledge of such facts plays a causal role in fixing the content of DOG, but on Fodor’s view they don’t play a constitutive one. For while such epistemic properties mediate the connection between tokens of DOG and dogs, this a mere “engineering” fact about us, which has no implications for the metaphysics of concepts or concept possession (1998a, p. 78). As Fodor puts it, “it’s that your mental structures contrive to resonate to doghood, not how your mental structures contrive to resonate to doghood, that is constitutive of concept possession” (1998a, p. 76). Although the internal relations that DOG bears to other concepts and to percepts are what mediate the connection between DOG and dogs, such relations are not concept-constitutive.

Fodor’s theory is thus a version of semantic externalism, according to which the meaning of a concept is exhausted by its reference. There are two well-known problems with any such theory: Frege cases, which putatively show that concepts that have different meanings can nevertheless be referentially identical; and Twin cases, which putatively show that concepts that are referentially distinct can nevertheless have the same meaning. Together, Frege cases and Twin cases suggest that meaning and reference are independent in both directions. Fodor has had much to say about each kind of case, and his views on both have changed over the years.

If conceptual content is exhausted by reference, then two concepts with the same referent ought to be identical in content. As Fodor puts it, “if meaning is information, then coreferential representations must be synonyms” (1998a, p. 12). But, prima facie, this is false. For as Frege pointed out, it’s easy to generate substitution failures involving coreferential concepts: “John believes that Hesperus is beautiful” may be true while “John believes that Phosphorus is beautiful” is false; “Thales believes that there’s water in the cup” may be true while “Thales believes that there’s H2O in the cup” is false; and so on. Since it’s widely believed that substitution tests are tests for synonymy, such cases suggest that coreferential concepts aren’t synonyms. In light of this, Fregeans introduce a layer of meaning in addition to reference that allows for a semantic distinction between coreferential but distinct concepts. On their view, coreferential concepts are distinct because they have different senses, or “modes of presentation” of a referent, which Fregeans typically individuate in terms of conceptual role (Peacocke 1992).

In one of Fodor’s important early articles on the topic, “Methodological Solipsism Considered as a Research Strategy in Cognitive Psychology” (1980), he argued that psychological explanations depend upon opaque taxonomies of mental states, and that we must distinguish the content of coreferential terms for the purposes of psychological explanation. At that time Fodor thus allowed for a kind of content that’s determined by the internal roles of symbols, which he speculated might be “reconstructed as aspects of form, at least insofar as appeals to content figure in accounts of the mental causation of behavior” (1981, p. 240). However, once he adopted a purely externalist semantics (Fodor 1994), Fodor could no longer allow for a notion of content determined by such internal relations. If conceptual content is exhausted by reference, as informational semantics has it, then there cannot be a semantic distinction between coreferential but distinct concepts.

In later work Fodor thus proposes to distinguish coreferential concepts purely syntactically, and argues that we treat modes of presentation (MOPs) as the representational vehicles of thoughts (Fodor 1994, 1998a, 2008). For instance, while Thales’ ‘water-MOP’ has the same content as his ‘H2O-MOP’ (were he to have one), they are nevertheless syntactically distinct (for example, only the latter has hydrogen as a constituent), and will thus differ in the causal and inferential relations they enter into. In taking MOPs to be the syntactically-individuated vehicles of thought, Fodor’s treatment of Frege cases serves to connect his theory of concepts with RTM. As he puts it:

It’s really the basic idea of RTM that Turing’s story about the nature of mental processes provides the very candidates for MOP-hood that Frege’s story about the individuation of mental states independently requires. If that’s true, it’s about the nicest thing that ever happened to cognitive science (1998a, p. 22).

An interesting consequence of this treatment is that people’s behavior in Frege cases can no longer be given an intentional explanation. Instead, such behavior is explained at the level of syntactically-individuated representations If, as Fodor suggested in his early work (1981), psychological explanations standardly depend upon opaque taxonomies of mental states, then this treatment of Frege cases would threaten the need for intentional explanations in psychology. In an attempt to block this threat, Fodor (1994) argues that Frege cases are in fact quite rare, and can be understood as exceptions rather than counterexamples to psychological laws couched in terms of broad content. The viability of a view that combines a syntactic treatment of Frege cases with RTM has been the focus of a fair amount of recent literature; see Arjo (1997), Aydede (1998), Aydede and Robins (2001), Brook and Stainton (1997), Rives (2009), Segal (1997), and Schneider (2005).

Let us now turn to Fodor’s treatment of Twin cases. Putnam (1975) asks us to imagine a place, Twin Earth, which is just like earth except the stuff Twin Earthians pick out with the concept water is not H2O but some other chemical compound XYZ. Consider Oscar and Twin Oscar, who are both entertaining the thought there’s water in the glass. Since they’re physical duplicates, they’re type-identical with respect to everything mental inside their heads. However, Oscar’s thought is true just in case there’s H2O in the glass, whereas Twin Oscar’s thought is true just in case there’s XYZ in the glass. A purely externalist semantics thus seems to imply that Oscar and Twin Oscar’s WATER concepts are of distinct types, despite the fact that Oscar and Twin Oscar are type-identical with respect to everything mental inside their heads. Supposing that intentional laws are couched in terms of broad content, it would follow that Oscar’s and Twin Oscar’s water-directed behavior don’t fall under the same intentional laws.

Such consequence have seemed unacceptable to many, including Fodor, who in his book Psychosemantics (1987) argues that we need a notion of “narrow” content that allows us to account for the fact that Oscar’s and Twin-Oscar’s mental states will have the same causal powers despite differences in their environments. Fodor there defends a “mapping” notion of narrow content, inspired by David Kaplan’s work on demonstratives, according to which the narrow content of a concept is a function from contexts to broad contents (1987, ch. 2). The narrow content of Oscar’s and Twin Oscar’s concept WATER is thus a function that maps Oscar’s context onto the broad content H2O and Twin Oscar’s context onto the broad content XYZ. Such narrow content is shared because Oscar and Twin Oscar are computing the same function. It was Fodor’s hope that this notion of narrow content would allow him to respect the standard Twin-Earth intuitions, while at the same time claim that the intentional properties relevant for psychological explanation supervene on facts internal to thinkers.

However, in The Elm and the Expert (1994) Fodor gives up on the notion of narrow content altogether, and argues that intentional psychology need not worry about Twin cases. Such cases, Fodor claims, only show that it’s conceptually (not nomologically) possible that broad content doesn’t supervene on facts internal to thinkers. One thus can not appeal to such cases to “argue against the nomological supervenience of broad content on computation since, as far as anybody knows … chemistry allows nothing that is as much like water as XYZ is supposed to be except water” (1994, p. 28). So since Putnam’s Twin Earth is nomologically impossible, and “empirical theories are responsible only to generalizations that hold in nomologically possible worlds,” Twin cases pose no threat to a broad content psychology (1994, p. 29). If it turned out that such cases did occur, then, according to Fodor, the generalizations missed by a broad content psychology would be purely accidental (1994, pp. 30-33). Fodor’s settled view is thus that Twin cases, like Frege cases, cases are fully compatible with an intentional psychology that posits only two dimensions to concepts: syntactically-individuated internal representations and broad contents.

6. Nativism

In The Language of Thought (1975), Fodor argued not only in favor of RTM but also in favor of the much more controversial view that all lexical concepts are innate. Fodor’s argument starts with the noncontroversial claim that in order to learn a concept one must learn its meaning, or content. Empiricist models of concept learning typically assume that thinkers learn a concept on the basis of experience by confirming a hypothesis about its meaning. But Fodor argues that such models will apply only to those concepts whose meanings are semantically complex. For instance, if the meaning of BACHELOR is unmarried, adult, male, then a thinker can learn bachelor by confirming the hypothesis that it applies to things that are unmarried, adult, and male. Of course, being able to formulate this hypothesis requires that one possess the concepts UNMARRIED, ADULT, and MALE. The empiricist model thus will not apply to primitive concepts that lack internal structure that can be mentally represented in this way. For instance, one can not formulate the hypothesis that red things fall under RED unless one already has RED, for the concept RED is a constituent of that very hypothesis. Primitive concepts like RED, therefore, must not be learned and must be innate. If, as Fodor argues, all lexical concepts are primitive, then it follows that all lexical concepts are innate (1975, ch. 2). Fodor’s claim is not that people are born possessing lexical concepts; experience must play a role on any account of concept acquisition (just as it does on any account of language acquisition). Fodor’s claim is that concepts are not learned on the basis of experience, but rather are triggered by it. As Fodor sometimes puts it, the relation between experience and concept acquisition is brute-causal, not rational or evidential (Fodor 1981b).

Of course, most theories of concepts—such as inferential role and prototype theories, discussed above—assume that many lexical concepts have some kind of internal structure. In fact, theorists are sometimes explicit that their motivation for positing complex lexical structure is to reduce the number of primitives in the lexicon. As Ray Jackendoff says:

Nearly everyone thinks that learning anything consists of constructing it from previously known parts, using previously known means of combination. If we trace the learning process back and ask where the previously known parts came from, and their previously know parts came from, eventually we have to arrive at a point where the most basic parts are not learned: they are given to the learner genetically, by virtue of the character of brain development. … Applying this view to lexical learning, we conclude that lexical concepts must have a compositional structure, and that the word learner’s [functional]-mind is putting meanings together from smaller parts (2002, 334). (See also Levin and Pinker 1991, p. 4.)

It’s worth stressing that while those in the empiricist tradition typically assume that the primitives are sensory concepts, those who posit complex lexical structure need not commit themselves to any such claim. Rather, they may simply assume that very few lexical items are not decomposable, and deal with the issue of primitives on a case by case basis, as Jackendoff (2002) does. In fact, many of the (apparent) primitives appealed to in the literature—for example, EVENT, THING, STATE, CAUSE, and so forth—are quite abstract and thus not ripe for an empiricist treatment.

In any case, Fodor is led to adopt informational atomism, in part, because he isn’t persuaded by the evidence that lexical concepts have any structure, decompositional or otherwise. He thus does not think that appealing to lexical structure provides an adequate reply to his argument for concept nativism (Fodor 1981b, 1998a, Fodor and Lepore 2002). If lexical concepts are primitive, and primitive concepts are unlearned, then lexical concepts are unlearned.

In his book Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong (1998a), Fodor worries about whether his earlier view is adequate. In particular, he’s concerned about whether it has the resources to explain questions such as why it is experiences with doorknobs that trigger the concept DOORKNOB:

[T]here’s a further constraint that whatever theory of concepts we settle on should satisfy: it must explain why there is so generally a content relation between the experience that eventuates in concept attainment and the concept that the experience eventuates in attaining. … [A]ssuming that primitive concepts are triggered, or that they’re ‘caught’, won’t account for their content relation to their causes; apparently only induction will. But primitive concepts can’t be induced; to suppose that they are is circular. (1998a, p. 132

Fodor’s answer to this worry involves a metaphysical claim about the nature of the properties picked out by most of our lexical concepts. In particular, he claims that it’s constitutive of these properties that our minds “lock” to them as a result of experience with their stereotypical instances. As Fodor puts it, being a doorknob is just “being the kind of thing that our kinds of minds (do or would) lock to from experience with instances of the doorknob stereotype” (1998a, p. 137). By making such properties mind-dependent in this way, Fodor thus provides a metaphysical reply to his worry above: there need not be a cognitive or evidential relation between our experiences with doorknobs and our acquisition of DOORKNOB, for being a doorknob just is the property that our minds lock to as a result of experiencing stereotypical instances of doorknobs. Fodor sums up his view as follows:

[I]f the locking story about concept possession and the mind-dependence story about the metaphysics of doorknobhood are both true, then the kind of nativism about doorknob that an informational atomist has to put up with is perhaps not one of concepts but of mechanisms. That consequence may be some consolation to otherwise disconsolate Empiricists. (1998a, p. 142)

In his recent book, LOT 2: The Language of Thought Revisited (2008), Fodor extends his earlier discussions of concept nativism. Whereas his previous argument turned on the empirical claim that lexical concepts are internally unstructured, Fodor now says that this claim is “superfluous”: “What I should have said is that it’s true and a priori that the whole notion of concept learning is per se confused” (2008, p. 130). Fodor thus argues that even patently complex concepts, such as GREEN OR TRIANGULAR, are unlearnable. Learning this concept would require confirming the hypothesis that the things that fall under it are either green or triangular. However, Fodor says:

[T]he inductive evaluation of that hypothesis itself requires (inter alia) bringing the property green or triangular before the mind as such. You can’t represent something as green or triangular unless have the concepts GREEN, OR, and TRIANGULAR. Quite generally, you can’t represent anything as such as such unless you already have the concept such and such. … This conclusion is entirely general; it doesn’t matter whether the target concept is primitive (like green) or complex (like GREEN OR TRIANGULAR). (2008, p. 139)

Fodor’s diagnosis of this problem is that standard learning models wrongly assume that acquiring a concept is a matter of acquiring beliefs Instead, Fodor suggests that “beliefs are constructs out of concepts, not the other way around,” and that the failure to recognize this is what leads to the above circularity (2008, pp. 139-140; see also Fodor’s debate with Piaget in Piattelli-Palmarini, 1980).

Fodor’s story about concept nativism in LOT 2 runs as follows: although no concepts—not even complex ones—are learned, concept acquisition nevertheless involves inductive generalizations. We acquire concepts as a result of experiencing their stereotypical instances, and learning a stereotype is an inductive process. Of course, if concepts were stereotypes then it would follow that concept acquisition would be an inductive process. But, Fodor says, concepts can’t be stereotypes since stereotypes violate compositionality (see above). Instead, Fodor suggests that learning a stereotype is a stage in the acquisition of a concept. His picture thus looks like this (2008, p. 151):

Initial state → (P1) → stereotype formation → (P2) → locking (= concept attainment).

Why think that P1 is an inductive process? Fodor says there are “well-known empirical results suggesting that even very young infants are able to recognize and respond to statistical regularities in their environments,” and “a genetically endowed capacity for statistical induction would make sense if stereotype formation is something that minds are frequently employed to do” (2008, p. 153). What makes this picture consistent with Fodor’s claim that “there can’t be any such thing as concept learning” (p. 139) is that he does not take P2 to be an inferential or intentional process (pp. 154-155). What kind of process is it? Here, Fodor doesn’t have much to say, other than it’s the “kind of thing that our sort of brain tissue just does”: “Psychology gets you from the initial state to P2; then neurology takes over and gets you the rest of the way to concept attainment” (p. 152). So, again, Fodor’s ultimate story about concept nativism is consistent with the view, as he puts it in Concepts, that “maybe there aren’t any innate ideas after all” (1998a, p. 143). Instead, there are innate mechanisms, which he now claims take us from the acquisition of stereotypes to the acquisition of concepts.

7. Modularity

In his influential book, The Modularity of Mind (1983), Fodor argues that the mind contains a number of highly specialized, “modular” systems, whose operations are largely independent from each other and from the “central” system devoted to reasoning, belief fixation, decision making, and the like. In that book, Fodor was particularly interested in defending a modular view of perception against the so-called “New Look” psychologists and philosophers (for example, Bruner, Kuhn, Goodman), who took cognition to be more or less continuous with perception. Whereas New Look theorists focused on evidence suggesting various top-down effects in perceptual processing (ways in which what people believe and expect can affect what they see), Fodor was impressed by evidence from the other direction suggesting that perceptual processes lack access to such “background” information. Perceptual illusions provide a nice illustration. In the famous Müller-Lyer illusion (Figure 1), for instance, the top line looks longer than the bottom line even though they’re identical in length.


Figure 1. The Müller-Lyer Illusion

Standard explanations of the illusion appeal to certain background assumptions the visual system is making, which effectively ‘override’ the fact that the retinal projections are identical in length. However, as Fodor pointed out, if knowing that the two lines are identical in length does not change the fact that one looks longer than the other, then clearly perceptual processes don’t have access to all of the information available to the perceiver. Thus, there must be limits on how much information is available to the visual system for use in perceptual inferences. In other words, vision must be in some interesting sense modular. The same goes for other sensory/input systems, and, on Fodor’s view, certain aspects of language processing.

Fodor spells out a number of characteristic features of modules. That knowledge of an illusion doesn’t make the illusion go away illustrates one of their central features, namely, that they are informationally encapsulated. Fodor says:

[T]he claim that input systems are informationally encapsulated is equivalent to the claim that the data that can bear on the confirmation of perceptual hypotheses includes, in the general case, considerably less that the organism may know. That is, the confirmation function for input systems does not have access to all the information that the organism internally represents. (1983, p. 69)

In addition, modules are supposed to be domain specific, in the sense that they’re restricted in the sorts of representations (such as visual, auditory, or linguistic) that can serve as their inputs (1983, pp. 47-52). They’re also mandatory. For instance, native English speakers cannot hear utterances of English as mere noise (“You all know what Swedish and Chinese sound like; what does English sound like?” 1983, p. 54), and people with normal vision and their eyes open cannot help but see the 3-D objects in front of them. In general, modules “approximate the condition so often ascribed to reflexes: they are automatically triggered by the stimuli that they apply to” (1983, pp. 54-55). Not only are modular processes domain-specific and out of our voluntary control, they’re also exceedingly fast. For instance, subjects can “shadow” speech (repeat what is heard when it’s heard) with a latency of about 250 milliseconds, and match a description to a picture with 96% accuracy when exposed for a mere 167 milliseconds (1983, pp. 61-64). In addition, modules have shallow outputs, in the sense that the information they carry is simple, or constrained in some way, which is required because otherwise the processing required to generate them couldn’t be encapsulated. As Fodor says, “if the visual system can deliver news about protons, then the likelihood that visual analysis is informationally encapsulated is negligible” (1983, p. 87). Fodor tentatively suggests that the visual system delivers as outputs “basic” perceptual categories (Rosch et al. 1976) such as dog or chair, although others take shallow outputs to be altogether non-conceptual (see Carruthers 2006, p. 4). In addition to these features, Fodor also suggests that modules are associated with fixed neural architecture (1983, pp. 98-99), exhibit characteristic and specific breakdown patterns (1983, pp. 99-100), and have an ontogeny that exhibits a characteristic pace and sequencing (1983, pp. 100-101).

On Fodor’s view, although sensory systems are modular, the “central” systems underlying belief fixation, planning, decision-making, and the like, are not. The latter exhibit none of the characteristic features associated with modules since they are domain-general, unencapsulated, under our voluntary control, slow, and not associated with fixed neural structures. Fodor draws attention, in particular, to two distinguishing features of central systems: they’re isotropic, in the sense that “in principle, any of one’s cognitive commitments (including, of course, the available experiential data) is relevant to the (dis)confirmation of any new belief” (2008, p. 115); and they’re Quinean, in the sense that they compute over the entirety of one’s belief system, as when one settles on the simplest, most conservative overall belief—as Fodor puts it, “the degree of confirmation assigned to any given hypothesis is sensitive to properties of the entire belief system” (1983, p. 107). Fodor’s picture of mental architecture is one in which there are a number of informationally encapsulated modules that process the outputs of transducer systems, and then generate representations that are integrated in a non-modular central system. The Fodorean mind is thus essentially a big general-purpose computer, with a number of domain-specific computers out near the edges that feed into it.

Fodor’s work on modularity has been criticized on a number of fronts. Empiricist philosophers and psychologists are typically quite happy with the claim that the central system is domain-general, but have criticized Fodor’s claim that input systems are modular (see Prinz 2006 for a recent overview of such criticisms). Fodor’s work has also been attacked from the other direction, by those who share his rationalist and nativist sympathies. Most notably, evolutionary psychologists reject Fodor’s claim that there must be a non-modular system responsible for integrating modular outputs, and argue instead that the mind is nothing but a collection of modular systems (see, Barkow, Cosmides, and Tooby (1992), Carruthers (2006), Pinker (1997), and Sperber (2002)). According to such “massive modularity” theorists, what Fodor calls the “central” system is in fact built up out of a number of domain-specific modules, for example, modules devoted to common-sense reasoning about physics, biology, psychology, and the detection of cheaters, to name a few prominent examples from the literature. Evolutionary psychologists also claim that these central modules are adaptations, that is, products of selection pressures that faced our hominid ancestors; see Pinker (1997) for an introduction to evolutionary psychology, and Carruthers (2006) for what is perhaps the most sophisticated defense of massive modularity to date.

That Fodor is a nativist might lead one to believe that he is sympathetic to applying adaptationist reasoning to the human mind. This would be a mistake. Fodor has long been skeptical of the idea that the mind is a product of natural selection, and in his book The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way (2001) he replies to a number of arguments purporting to show that it must be. For instance, evolutionary psychologists claim that the mind must be “reverse engineered”: in order to figure out how it works, we must know what its function is; and in order to know what its function is we must know what it was selected for. Fodor rejects this latter inference, and claims that natural selection is not required in order to underwrite claims about the teleology of the mind. For the notion of function relevant for psychology might be synchronic, not diachronic: “You might think, after all, that what matters in understanding the mind is what ours do now, not what our ancestors’ did some millions of years ago” (1998b, p. 209). Indeed, in general, one does not need to know about the evolutionary history of a system in order to make inferences about its function:

[O]ne can often make a pretty shrewd guess what an organ is for on the basis of entirely synchronic considerations. One might thus guess that hands are for grasping, eyes for seeing, or even that minds are for thinking, without knowing or caring much about their history of selection. Compare Pinker (1997, p. 38): “psychologists have to look outside psychology if they want to explain what the parts of the mind are for.” Is this true? Harvey didn’t have to look outside physiology to explain what the heart is for. It is, in particular, morally certain that Harvey never read Darwin. Likewise, the phylogeny of bird flight is still a live issue in evolutionary theory. But, I suppose, the first guy to figure out what birds use their wings for lived in a cave. (2000, p. 86)

Fodor’s point is that even if one grants that natural selection underwrites teleological claims about the mind, it doesn’t follow that in order to understand a psychological mechanism one must understand the selection pressures that led to it.

Evolutionary psychologists also argue that the adaptive complexity of the human mind requires that one treat it as a collection of adaptations. For natural selection is the only known explanation for adaptive complexity in the living world. Fodor replies that the complexity of the mind is irrelevant when it comes to determining whether it’s a product of natural selection:

[W]hat matters to the plausibility that the architecture of our minds is an adaptation is how much genotypic alternation would have been required for it to evolve from the mind of the nearest ancestral ape whose cognitive architecture was different from ours. … [I]t’s entirely possible that quite small neurological reorganizations could have effected wild psychological discontinuities between our minds and the ancestral ape’s. (2000, pp. 87-88)

Given that we don’t currently know whether small neurological changes in the brains of our ancestors led to large changes in their cognitive capacities, Fodor says, the appeal to adaptive complexity does not warrant the claim that our minds are the product of natural selection. In his latest book co-authored with Massimo Piattelli-Palmarini, What Darwin Got Wrong (2010), Fodor argues that selectional explanations in general are both decreasingly of interest in biology and, on further reflection, actually incoherent. Perhaps needless to say, this view has occasioned considerable controversy; for examples see Sober (forthcoming), Block and Kitcher (2010), and Godfrey-Smith (2010).

In The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way (2000), and also in LOT 2 (2008), Fodor reiterates and defends his claim that the central systems are non-modular, and connects this view to general doubts about the adequacy of RTM as a comprehensive theory of the human mind. One of the main jobs of the central system is the fixation of belief via abductive inferences, and Fodor argues that the fact that such inferences are isotropic and Quinean shows they cannot be realized in a modular system. These features render belief fixation a “holistic”, “global”, and “context-dependent” affair, which implies that it is not realized in a modular, informationally-encapsulated system. Moreover, given RTM’s commitment to the claim that computational processes are sensitive only to local properties of mental representations, these holistic features of central cognition would appear to fall outside of RTM’s scope (2000, chs. 2-3; 2008, ch. 4).

Consider, for instance, the simplicity of a belief. As Fodor says: “The thought that there will be no wind tomorrow significantly complicates your arrangements if you had intended to sail to Chicago, but not if your plan was to fly, drive, or walk there” (2000, p. 26). Whether or not a belief complicates a plan thus depends upon the beliefs involved in the plan—that is, the simplicity of a belief is one of its global, context-dependent properties. However, the syntactic properties of representations are local, in the sense that they supervene on their intrinsic, context-independent properties. To the extent that cognition involves global properties of representations, then, Fodor concludes that RTM cannot provide a model of how cognition works:

[A] cognitive science that provides some insight into the part of the mind that isn’t modular may well have to be different, root and branch, from the kind of syntactical account that Turing’s insights inspired. It is, to return to Chomsky’s way of talking, a mystery, not just a problem, how mental processes could be simultaneously feasible and abductive and mechanical. Indeed, I think that, as things now stand, this and consciousness look to be the ultimate mysteries about the mind. (2000, p. 99).

Thus, although Fodor has long championed RTM as the best theory of cognition available, he thinks that its application is limited to those portions of the mind that are modular. Needless to say, many disagree with Fodor’s assessment of the limits of RTM (see Carruthers (2003, 2006), Ludwig and Schneider (2008), and Pinker (2005)).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Arjo, Dennis (1996) “Sticking Up for Oedipus: Fodor on Intentional Generalizations and Broad Content,” Mind & Language 11: 231-235.
  • Aydede, Murat (1998) “Fodor on Concepts and Frege Puzzles,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 79: 289-294.
  • Aydede, Murat & Philip Robbins (2001) “Are Frege Cases Exceptions to Intentional Generalizations?” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 31: 1-22.
  • Barkow, Jerome, Cosmides, Leda, and Tooby, John (Eds.) The Adapted Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Block, Ned (1993). “Holism, Hyper-Analyticity, and Hyper-Compositionality,” Philosophical Issues 3: 37-72.
  • Block, Ned and Philip Kitcher (2010) “Misunderstanding Darwin: Natural Selection’s Secular Critics Get it Wrong,” Boston Review (March/April).
  • Boghossian, Paul (1993). “Does Inferential Role Semantics Rest on a Mistake?” Philosophical Issues 3: 73-88.
  • Brook, Andrew and Robert Stainton (1997) “Fodor’s New Theory of Content and Computation,” Mind & Language 12: 459-474.
  • Carruthers, Peter (2003) “On Fodor’s Problem,” Mind & Language 18: 502-523.
  • Carruthers, Peter (2006) The Architecture of the Mind: Massive Modularity and the Flexibility of Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chomsky, Noam (1959) “A Review of B.F. Skinner’s Verbal Behavior,” Language 35: 26-58.
  • Evans, Gareth (1982) Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Janet, Jerry Fodor, and Merril Garrett (1975) “The Psychological Unreality of Semantic Representations,” Linguistic Inquiry 4: 515-531.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1970) “Three Reasons for Not Deriving “Kill” from “Cause to Die”,” Linguistic Inquiry 1: 429-438.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1974) “Special Sciences (Or: The Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis)” Synthese 28:97-115.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1975) The Language of Thought. New York: Crowell.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1980) “Methodological Solipsism Considered as a Research Strategy in Cognitive Psychology,” Behavioral and Brain Sciences 3: 63-109. Reprinted in Fodor (1981a).
  • Fodor, Jerry (1981a) RePresentations: Philosophical Essays on the Foundations of Cognitive Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press
  • Fodor, Jerry (1981b) “The Present Status of the Innateness Controversy,” In Fodor (1981a).
  • Fodor, Jerry (1983) The Modularity of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1986) “Why Paramecia Don’t Have Mental Representations,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 10: 3-23.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1987) Psychosemantics: The Problem of Meaning in the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1989) “Making mind matter more,” Philosophical Topics 67: 59-79.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1990) A Theory of Content and Other Essays. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1994) The Elm and the Expert: Mentalese and Its Semantics. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1998a) Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1998b) In Critical Condition: Polemical Essays on Cognitive Science and the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (2000) The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way: The Scope and Limits of Computational Psychology. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (2003) Hume Variations. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (2004) “Having Concepts: A Brief Refutation of the 20th Century,” Mind & Language 19: 29-47.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Charles Chihara (1965) “Operationalism and Ordinary Language,” American Philosophical Quarterly 2: 281-295.
  • Fodor, Jerry, Thomas Bever, and Merrill Garrett (1974) The Psychology of Language: An Introduction to Psycholinguistics and Generative Grammar. New York: McGraw Hill.
  • Fodor, Jerry, Merril Garrett, Edward Walker, and Cornelia Parkes (1980) “Against Definitions,” Reprinted in Margolis and Laurence (1999).
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Author Information

Bradley Rives
Indiana University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

Liar Paradox

The Liar Paradox is an argument that arrives at a contradiction by reasoning about a Liar Sentence. The Classical Liar Sentence is the self-referential sentence, “This sentence is false,” which leads to the same difficulties as the sentence, “I am lying.”

Experts in the field of philosophical logic have never agreed on the way out of the trouble despite 2,300 years of attention. Here is the trouble—a sketch of the Liar Argument that reveals the contradiction:

Let L be the Classical Liar Sentence. If L is true, then L is false. But we can also establish the converse, as follows. Assume L is false. Because the Liar Sentence is just the sentence that ‘says’ L is false, the Liar Sentence is therefore true, so L is true. We have now shown that L is true if, and only if, it is false. Since L must be one or the other, it is both.

That contradictory result apparently throws us into the lion’s den of semantic incoherence. The incoherence is due to the fact that, according to the rules of classical logic, anything follows from a contradiction, even "1 + 1 = 3." This article explores the details and implications of the principal ways out of the Paradox, ways of restoring semantic coherence.

Most people, when first encountering the Liar Paradox, react in one of two ways. One reaction is to not take the Paradox seriously and say they won't reason any more about it. The second and more popular reaction is to say the Liar Sentence must be meaningless. Both of these reactions are a way out of the Paradox. That is, they stop the argument of the Paradox. However, the first reaction provides no useful diagnosis of the problem that was caused in the first place. The second is not an adequate solution if it can answer the question, “Why is the Liar Sentence meaningless?”  only with the ad hoc remark, “Otherwise we get a paradox.” An adequate solution should offer a more systematic treatment. For example, the self-referential English sentence, “This sentence is not in Italian,” is very similar to the Liar Sentence. Is it meaningless, too?  Apparently not. So, what feature of the Liar Sentence makes it be meaningless while “This sentence is not in Italian,” is not meaningless? The questions continue, and an adequate solution should address them systematically.

Table of Contents

  1. History of the Paradox
    1. Strengthened Liar
    2. Why the Paradox is a Serious Problem
    3. Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem
  2. Overview of Ways Out of the Paradox
    1. Five Ways Out
    2. Sentences, Statements, and Propositions
    3. An Ideal Solution to the Paradox
    4. Should Classical Logic be Revised?
  3. The Main Ways Out
    1. Russell’s Type Theory
    2. Tarski’s Hierarchy of Meta-Languages
    3. Kripke’s Hierarchy of Interpretations
    4. Barwise and Etchemendy
    5. Paraconsistency
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History of the Paradox

Languages are expected to contain contradictions but not paradoxes. The sentence, “Snow is white, and snow is not white,” is just one of the many false sentences in the English language. But languages are not expected to contain paradoxes. A paradox is an apparently convincing argument leading to the conclusion that one of the language’s contradictory sentences is true. Why is that a problem? Well, let L be the Liar sentence, and let Q be a sentence we already know cannot be true, say "1 + 1 = 3". Then we can reason this way:

1. L and not-L from the Liar Paradox
2. L from 1
3. L or Q from 2
4. not-L from 1
5. Q from 3 and 4

The consequence is outrageous. So, an appropriate reaction to any paradox is to look for some unacceptable assumption made in the apparently convincing argument or else to look for a faulty step in the reasoning. Only very reluctantly would one want to learn to live with the contradiction being true, or ignore the contradiction altogether. By the way, paradoxes are commonly called "antinomies," although some authors prefer to save the word "antinomies" for only the more difficult paradoxes to resolve.

Zeno's Paradoxes were discovered in the 5th century B.C.E., and the Liar Paradox was discovered in the middle of the 4th century B.C.E., both in ancient Greece. The most ancient attribution of the Liar is to Eubulides of Miletus who included it among a list of seven puzzles. He said, “A man says that he is lying. Is what he says true or false?” Eubulides’ commentary on his puzzle has not been found. An ancient gravestone on the Greek Island of Kos was reported by Athenaeus to contain this poem about the difficulty of solving the Paradox:

O Stranger: Philetas of Kos am I,

‘Twas the Liar who made me die,

And the bad nights caused thereby.

Theophrastus, Aristotle’s successor, wrote three papyrus rolls about the Liar Paradox, and the Stoic philosopher Chrysippus wrote six, but their contents are lost in the sands of time. Despite various comments on how to solve the Paradox, no Greek suggested that Greek itself was inconsistent; it was the reasoning within Greek that was considered to be inconsistent.

In the Late Medieval period in Europe, the French philosopher Jean Buridan put the Liar Paradox to devious use with the following proof of the existence of God. It uses the pair of sentences:

God exists.

None of the sentences in this pair is true.

The only consistent way to assign truth values, that is, to have these two sentence be either true or false, requires making “God exists” be true. So, in this way, Buridan has “proved” that God does exist.

There are many other versions of the Paradox. Some liar paradoxes begin with a chain of sentences, no one of which is self-referential, although the chain as a whole is self-referential or circular:

The following sentence is true.

The following sentence is true.

The following sentence is true.

The first sentence in this list is false.

There are also Contingent Liars which may or may not lead to a paradox depending on what happens in the world beyond the sentence. For example:

It’s raining and this sentence is false.

Paradoxicality now depends on the weather. If it’s sunny, then the sentence is simply false, but if it’s raining, then we have the beginning of a paradox.

a. Strengthened Liar

The Strengthened Liar Paradox begins with the Strengthened Liar Sentence

This sentence is not true.

This version is called “Strengthened” because some promising solutions to the Classical Liar Paradox beginning with (L) fail when faced with the Strengthened Liar. So, finding one’s way out of the Strengthened Liar Paradox is the acid test of a successful solution.

Here is an example of the failure just mentioned. Consider the Strengthened Liar in the context of trying to solve the Liar Paradox by declaring that the Liar Sentence L cannot be used to make a claim. It is neither true nor false. That will stop the argument of the Classical Liar Paradox involving L. But suppose this attempted solution is unsystematic and implies nothing about our various semantic principles and so implies nothing about the Strengthened Liar Sentence. If so, we could use that Strengthened Liar Sentence to create a new paradox by asking for its truth value. If it were to be true it would not be true. But if it were not true, then it would therefore be true, and so we have arrived at a contradiction. That is why we want any solution which says that the Classical Liar Sentence L has no truth value to be systematic enough that it can be applied to the Strengthened Liar Sentence and show that it, too, has no truth value. That way, we do not solve the Classical Liar only to be ensnared by the Strengthened Liar.

b. Why the Paradox is a Serious Problem

To put the Liar Paradox in perspective, it is essential to appreciate why such an apparently trivial problem is a deep problem. Solving the Liar Paradox is part of the larger project of understanding truth. Understanding truth involves finding a theory of truth or a definition of truth or a proper analysis of the concept of truth; many researchers do not carefully distinguish these projects from each other.

Aristotle offered what most philosophers consider to be a correct proposal. Stripped of his overtones suggesting a correspondence theory of truth, Aristotle proposed (in Metaphysics 1011 b26) what is now called a precursor to Alfred Tarski's Convention T:

(T) A sentence is true if, and only if, what it says is so.

Here we need to take some care with the use-mention distinction. If pairs of quotation marks serve to name or mention a sentence, then the above is requiring that the sentence “It is snowing” be true just in case it is snowing. Similarly, if the sentence about snow were named not with quotation marks but with the numeral 88 inside a pair of parentheses, then (88) would be true just in case it is snowing. What could be less controversial about the nature of truth? Unfortunately, this is neither obviously correct nor trivial; and the resolution of the difficulty is still an open problem in philosophical logic. Why is that? The brief answer is that (T) can be used to produce the Liar Paradox. The longer answer refers to Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem of 1936.

c. Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem

tarskiThis article began with a mere sketch of the Liar Argument using sentence (L). To appreciate the central role of (T) in the argument, we need to examine more than just a sketch of the argument. Alfred Tarski proposed a more formal characterization of (T), which is called schema T or Convention T:

(T) X is true if, and only if, p,

where “p” is a variable for a grammatical sentence and “X” is a name for that sentence. Tarski was the first person to claim that any theory of truth that could not entail all sentences of this schema would fail to be an adequate theory of truth. Here is what Tarski is requiring. If we want to build a theory of truth for English, and we want to state the theory using English, then the theory must entail the T-sentence:

“Snow is white” is true if, and only if, snow is white.

If we want instead to build a theory of truth for German and use English to state the theory, then the theory should, among other things, at least entail the T-sentence:

“Der Schnee ist weiss” is true in German if, and only if, snow is white.

A great many philosophers believe Tarski is correct when he claims his Convention T is a necessary condition on any successful theory of truth for any language. However, do we want all the T-sentences to be entailed and thus come out true? Probably not the T-sentence for the Liar Sentence. That T-sentence has the logical form: T`s´ if and only if s.  Here T is the truth predicate, and s is the Liar Sentence, namely ~T`s´. Substituting the latter for s on the right of the biconditional yields the contradiction: T`s´ if and only if ~T`s´. That is the argument of the Liar Paradox, very briefly. Tarski wanted to find a way out.

Tarski added precision to the discussion of the Liar by focusing not on a natural language but on a classical, interpreted, formal language capable of expressing arithmetic. Here the difficulties produced by the Liar Argument became much clearer; and, very surprisingly, he was able to prove that Convention T plus the assumption that the language contains its own concept of truth do lead to semantic incoherence.

The proof requires the following assumptions in addition to Convention T. Here we quote from (Tarski 1944):

I. We have implicitly assumed that the language in which the antinomy is constructed contains, in addition to its expressions, also the names of these expressions, as well as semantic terms such as the term "true" referring to sentences of this language; we have also assumed that all sentences which determine the adequate usage of this term can be asserted in the language. A language with these properties will be called "semantically closed."

II. We have assumed that in this language the ordinary laws of logic hold.

Tarski pointed out that the crucial, unacceptable assumption of the formal version of the Liar Argument is that the language is semantically closed. For there to be a grammatical and meaningful Liar Sentence in that language, there must be a definable notion of “is true” which holds for the true sentences and fails to hold for the other sentences. If there were such a global truth predicate, then the predicate “is a false sentence” would also be definable; and [here is where we need the power of elementary number theory] a Liar Sentence would exist, namely a complex sentence ∃x(Qx & ~Tx), where Q and T are predicates which are satisfied by names of sentences. More specifically, T is the one-place, global truth predicate satisfied by all the names [that is, numerals for the Gödel numbers] of the true sentences, and Q is a one-place predicate that is satisfied only by the name of ∃x(Qx & ~Tx). But if so, then one can eventually deduce a contradiction. This deduction of Tarski’s is a formal analog of the informal argument of the Liar Paradox. The contradictory result tells us that the argument began with a false assumption. According to Tarski, the error that causes the contradiction is the assumption that the global truth predicate can be well-defined. Therefore, Tarski has proved that truth is not definable within a classical formal language—thus the name “Undefinability Theorem.” Tarski’s Theorem establishes that classically interpreted languages capable of expressing arithmetic cannot contain a global truth predicate. So his theorem implies that classical formal languages with the power to express arithmetic cannot be semantically closed.

There is no special difficulty is giving a careful definition of truth for a classical formal language, provided we do it outside the language; and Tarski himself was the first person to do this. In 1933 he created the first formal semantics for quantified predicate logic. Here are two imperfect examples of how he defines truth. First, the simple sentence 'Fa' is true if, and only if, a is a member of the set of objects that are F. Notice that the crucial fact that the English truth predicate "is true" occurring in the definition of truth for the formal language does not also occur in the formal language. The formal language being examined, that is, being given a theory of truth, is what Tarski calls the "object language." For a second example of defining truth, Tarski says the universally quantified sentence '∀xFx' is true if, and only if, all the objects are members of the set of objects that are F. To repeat, a little more precisely but still imperfectly, Tarski's theory implies that, if we have a simple, formal sentence `Fa´ in our formal language, in which ` is the name of some object in the domain of discourse (that is, what we can talk about) and if ` is a predicate designating a property that perhaps some of those objects have, then `Fa´ is true in the object language if, and only if, a is a member of the set of all things having property F. For the more complex sentence `∀xFx´ in our language, it is true just in case every object is a member of the set of all things having property F. These two definitions are still imprecise because the appeal to the concept of property should be eliminated, and the definitions should appeal to the notion of formulas being satisfied by sequences of objects. However, what we have here are two examples of partially defining truth for the object language, say language 0, but doing it from outside language 0, in a meta-language, say language 1, that contains set theory and that might or might not contain language 0 itself. Tarski was able to show that in language 1 we satisfy Convention T for the object language 0, because the equivalences

`Fa´ is true in language 0 if, and only if, Fa

`∀xFx´ is true in language 0 if, and only if, ∀xFx

are both deducible in language 1, as are the other T-sentences.

Despite Tarski's having this success with defining truth for an object language in its meta-language, Tarski's Undefinability Theorem establishes that there is apparently no hope of defining truth within the object language itself. Tarski then took on the project of discovering how close he could come to having a well-defined truth predicate within a classical formal language without actually having one. That project, his hierarchy of meta-languages, is also his key idea for solving the Liar Paradox. It will be discussed in a moment.

2. Overview of Ways Out of the Paradox

a. Five Ways Out

We should avoid having to solve the Liar Paradox merely by declaring that our logic obeys the principle "Avoid paradoxes." That gives us no guidance about how to avoid them. Since the Liar Paradox depends crucially upon our rules of making inferences and on the key semantic concepts of truth, reference, and negation, one might reasonably suppose that one of these rules or concepts needs revision. No one wants to solve the Paradox by being heavy-handed and jettisoning more than necessary.

Where should we make the changes? If we adopt the metaphor of a paradox as being an argument which starts from the home of seemingly true assumptions and which travels down the garden path of seemingly valid steps into the den of a contradiction, then a solution to the Liar Paradox has to find something wrong with the home, find something wrong with the garden path, or find a way to live within the den. Less metaphorically, the main ways out of the Paradox are the following:

  1. The Liar Sentence is ungrammatical and so has no truth value (yet the argument of the Liar Paradox depends on it having a truth value).
  2. The Liar Sentence is grammatical but meaningless and so has no truth value.
  3. The Liar Sentence is grammatical and meaningful but still it has no truth value; it falls into the “truth gap.”
  4. The Liar Sentence is grammatical, meaningful and has a truth value, but one other step in the argument of the Liar Paradox is faulty.
  5. The argument of the Liar Paradox is acceptable, and we need to learn how to live with the Liar Sentence being both true and false.

Two philosophers might take the same way out, but for different reasons.

There are many suggestions for how to deal with the Liar Paradox, but most are never developed to the point of giving a formal, detailed theory that can speak of its own syntax and semantics with precision. Some give philosophical arguments for why this or that conceptual reform is plausible as a way out of paradox, but then don’t show that their ideas can be carried through in a rigorous way. Other attempts at solutions will take the formal route and then require changes in standard formalisms so that a formal analog of the Liar Paradox’s argument fails, but then the attempted solution offers no philosophical argument to back up these formal changes. A decent theory of truth showing the way out of the Liar Paradox requires both a coherent formalism (or at least a systematic theory of some sort) and a philosophical justification backing it up. The point of the philosophical justification is an unveiling of some hitherto unnoticed or unaccepted rule of language for all sentences of some category which has been violated by the argument of the Paradox.

The leading solutions to the Liar Paradox, that is, the influential proposed solutions, all have a common approach, the “systematic approach.” The developers of these solutions agree that the Liar Paradox represents a serious challenge to our understanding the concepts, rules, and logic of natural language; and they agree that we must go back and systematically reform or clarify some of our original beliefs, and provide a motivation for doing so other than that doing so blocks the Paradox.

This need to have a systematic approach has been seriously challenged by Ludwig Wittgenstein (in 1938 in a discussion group with Alan Turing on the foundations of mathematics). He says one should try to overcome ”the superstitious fear and dread of mathematicians in the face of a contradiction.” The proper way to respond to any paradox, he says, is by an ad hoc reaction and not by any systematic treatment designed to cure both it and any future ills. Symptomatic relief is sufficient. It may appear legitimate, at first, to admit that the Liar Sentence is meaningful and also that it is true or false, but the Liar Paradox shows that one should retract this admission and either just not use the Liar Sentence in any arguments, or say it is not really a sentence, or at least say it is not one that is either true or false. Wittgenstein is not particularly concerned with which choice is made. And, whichever choice is made, it need not be backed up by any theory that shows how to systematically incorporate the choice. He treats the whole situation cavalierly and unsystematically. After all, he says, the language can’t really be incoherent because we have been successfully using it all along, so why all this “fear and dread”? Most logicians want systematic removal of the Paradox, but Wittgenstein is content to say that we may need to live with this paradox and to agree never to utter the Liar Sentence, especially if it seems that removal of the contradiction could have worse consequences.

P. F. Strawson has promoted the performative theory of truth as a way out of the Liar Paradox. Strawson has argued that the proper way out of the Liar Paradox is to carefully re-examine how the term “truth” is really used by speakers. He says such an investigation will reveal that the Liar Sentence is meaningful but fails to express a proposition. To explore this response more deeply, notice that Strawson’s proposed solution depends on the distinction between a proposition and the declarative sentence used to express that proposition. The next section explores what a proposition is, but let's agree for now that a sentence, when uttered, either expresses a true proposition, expresses a false proposition, or fails to express any proposition. According to Strawson, when we say some proposition is true, we are not making a statement about the proposition. We are not ascribing a property to the proposition such as the property of correspondence to the facts, or coherence, or usefulness. Rather, when we call a proposition “true,” we are only approving it, or praising it, or admitting it, or condoning it. We are performing an action of that sort. Similarly, when we say to our friend, “I promise to pay you fifty dollars,” we are not ascribing some property to the proposition, “I pay you fifty dollars.” Rather, we are performing the act of promising the $50. For Strawson, when speakers utter the Liar Sentence, they are attempting to praise a proposition that is not there, as if they were saying “Ditto” when no one has spoken. The person who utters the Liar Sentence is making a pointless utterance. According to this performative theory, the Liar Sentence is grammatical, but it is not being used to express a proposition and so is not something from which a contradiction can be derived.

b. Sentences, Statements, and Propositions

The Liar Paradox can be expressed in terms of sentences, statements, or propositions. We appropriately speak of the sentence, “This sentence is false,” and of the statement that this statement is false, and of the proposition that this proposition is false. Sentences are linguistic expressions whereas statements and propositions are not. When speaking about sentences, we are nearly always speaking about sentence types, not tokens. A token is the sound waves or the ink marks; these are specific collections of molecules. Philosophers do not agree on what a sentence is, but they disagree more about what a statement is, and they disagree even more about what a proposition is.

Despite Quine's famous complaint that there are no propositions because there can be no precise criteria for deciding whether two different sentences are being used to express identical propositions, there are some good reasons why researchers who work on the Liar Paradox should focus on propositions rather than either sentences or statements, but those reasons will not be explored here. [For a discussion, see (Barwise and Etchemendy 1987).] The present article will continue to speak primarily of sentences rather than propositions, though only for the purpose of simplicity.

c. An Ideal Solution to the Liar Paradox

We expect that any seriously proposed solution to the Liar Paradox will offer a better diagnosis of the problem than merely, “It stops the Liar Paradox.” A solution which says, “Quit using language” also will stop the Liar Paradox, but the Liar Paradox can be stopped by making more conservative changes than this. Hopefully any proposal to refine our semantic principles will be conservative for another reason: We want to minimize the damage; we want to minimize the amount and drastic nature of the changes because, all other things being equal, simple and intuitive semantic principles are to be preferred to complicated and less intuitive semantic principles. The same goes for revision of a concept or revision of a logic.

Ideally, we would like for a proposed solution to the Liar Paradox to provide a solution to all the versions of the Liar Paradox, such as the Strengthened Liar Paradox, the version that led to Buridan’s proof of God’s existence, and the contingent versions of the Liar Paradoxes. The solution should solve the paradox both for natural languages and formal languages, or provide a good explanation of why the paradox can be treated properly only in a formal language. The contingent versions of the Liar Paradox are going to be especially troublesome because if the production of the paradox doesn't depend only on something intrinsic to the sentence but also depends on what circumstances occur in the world, then there needs to be a detailed description of when those circumstances are troublesome and when they are not, and why.

It would be reasonable to expect a solution to tell us about the self-referential Truth-teller sentence:

This sentence is true.

It would also be reasonable to tell us how important self-reference is to the Liar Paradox. In the late 20th century, Stephen Yablo produced a semantic paradox that, he claims, shows that neither self-reference nor circularity is an essential feature of all the Liar paradoxes. In his paradox, there apparently is no way to coherently assign a truth value to any of the sentences in the countably infinite sequence of sentences of the form, “None of the subsequent sentences are true.” Imagine an unending line of people who say:

1. Everybody after me is lying.

2. Everybody after me is lying.

3. Everybody after me is lying.


Ask yourself whether the first person's sentence in the sequence is true or false. Notice that no sentence overtly refers to itself. To produce the paradox it is crucial that the line of speakers be infinite. There is controversy in the literature about whether the paradox actually contains a hidden appeal to self-reference or circularity. See (Beall 2001) for more discussion.

An important goal for the best solution, or solutions, to the Liar Paradox is to offer us a deeper understanding of how our semantic concepts and principles worked to produce the Paradox in the first place, especially if a solution to the Paradox requires changing or at least clarifying them. We want to understand the concepts of truth, reference, and negation that are involved in the Paradox. In addition to these, there are the subsidiary principles and related notions of denial, definability, naming, meaning, predicate, property, presupposition, antecedent, and operating on prior sentences to form newer meaningful ones rather than merely newer grammatical ones. We would like to know what limits there are on all these notions and mechanisms, and how one impacts another.

What are the important differences among the candidates for bearers of truth? The leading candidates are sentences, propositions, statements, claims, and utterances. Is one primary, while the others are secondary or derivative? And we would like know a great deal more about truth, especially truth, but also falsehood, and the related notions of fact, situation and state of affairs. We want to better understand what a language is and what the relationship is between an interpreted formal language and a natural language, relative to different purposes. Finally, it would be instructive to learn how the Liar Paradoxes are related to all the other paradoxes. That may be a lot of ask, but then our civilization does have considerable time before the Sun expands and vaporizes our little planet.

d. Should Classical Logic be Revised?

An important question regarding the Liar Paradox is: What is the relationship between a solution to the Paradox for (interpreted) formal languages and a solution to the Paradox for natural languages? There is significant disagreement on this issue. Is appeal to a formal language a turn away from the original problem, and so just changing the subject? Can one say we are still on the subject when employing a formal language because a natural language contains implicitly within it some formal language structure? Or should we be in the business of building an ideal language to replace natural language for the purpose of philosophical study?

Do we always reason informally in a semantically closed language, namely ordinary English? Or is it not clear what logic there is in English, and perhaps we should conclude from the Liar Paradox that the logic of English cannot be standard logic but must be one that restricts the explosion that occurs due to our permitting the deduction of anything whatsoever from a contradiction? Should we say English really has truth gaps or perhaps occasional truth gluts (sentences that are both true and false)?

Or instead can a formal language be defended on the ground that natural language is inconsistent and the formal language is showing the best that can be done rigorously? Can sense even be made of the claim that a natural language is inconsistent, for is not consistency a property only of languages with a rigorous structure, namely formal languages and not natural languages? Should we say people can reason inconsistently in natural language without declaring the natural language itself to be inconsistent? This article raises, but will not resolve, these questions, although some are easier to answer than others.

Many of the most important ways out of the Liar Paradox recommend revising classical formal logic. Classical logic is the formal logic known to introductory logic students as "predicate logic" in which, among other things, (i) all sentences of the formal language have exactly one of two possible truth values (TRUE, FALSE), (ii) the rules of inference allow one to deduce any sentence from an inconsistent set of assumptions, (iii) all predicates are totally defined on the range of the variables, and (iv) the formal semantics is the one invented by Tarski that provided the first precise definition of truth for a formal language in its metalanguage. A few philosophers of logic argue against any revision of classical logic by saying it is the incumbent formalism that should be accepted unless an alternative is required (probably it is believed to be incumbent because of its remarkable success in expressing most of modern mathematical inference). Still, most other philosophers argue that classical logic is not the incumbent which must remain in office unless an opponent can dislodge it. Instead, the office has always been vacant (for the purpose of examining natural language and its paradoxes).

Some philosophers object to revising classical logic if the purpose in doing so is merely to find a way out of the Paradox. They say that philosophers shouldn’t build their theories by attending to the queer cases. There are more pressing problems in the philosophy of logic and language than finding a solution to the Paradox, so any treatment of it should wait until these problems have a solution. From the future resulting theory which solves those problems, one could hope to deduce a solution to the Liar Paradox. However, for those who believe the Paradox is not a minor problem but is one deserving of immediate attention, there can be no waiting around until the other problems of language are solved. Perhaps the investigation of the Liar Paradox will even affect the solutions to those other problems.

3. The Main Ways Out

There have been many systematic proposals for ways out of the Liar Paradox. Below is a representative sample of five of the main ways out.

a. Russell’s Type Theory

Bertrand Russell said natural language is incoherent, but its underlying sensible part is an ideal formal language (such as the applied predicate logic of Principia Mathematica). He agreed with Henri Poincaré that the source of the Liar trouble is its use of self-reference. Russell wanted to rule out self-referential sentences as being ungrammatical or not well-formed in his ideal language, and in this way solve the Liar Paradox.

In 1908 in his article “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types” that is reprinted in (Russell 1956, p. 79), Russell solves the Liar with his ramified theory of types. This is a formal language involving an infinite hierarchy of, among other things, orders of propositions:

If we now revert to the contradictions, we see at once that some of them are solved by the theory of types. Whenever ‘all propositions’ are mentioned, we must substitute ‘all propositions of order n’, where it is indifferent what value we give to n, but it is essential that n should have some value. Thus when a man says ‘I am lying’, we must interpret him as meaning: ‘There is a proposition of order n, which I affirm, and which is false’. This is a proposition of order n+1; hence the man is not affirming any propositions of order n; hence his statement is false, and yet its falsehood does not imply, as that of ‘I am lying’ appeared to do, that he is making a true statement. This solves the liar.

Russell’s implication is that the informal Liar Sentence is meaningless because it has no appropriate translation into his formal language since an attempted translation violates his type theory. This theory is one of his formalizations of the Vicious-Circle Principle: Whatever involves all of a collection must not be one of the collection. Russell believed that violations of this principle are the root of all the logical paradoxes.

His solution to the Liar Paradox has the drawback that it places so many subscript restrictions on what can refer to what. It is unfortunate that the Russell hierarchy requires even the apparently harmless self-referential sentences “This sentence is in English” and "This sentence is not in Italian" to be syntactically ill-formed. The type theory also rules out saying that legitimate terms must have a unique type, or that properties have the property of belonging to exactly one category in the hierarchy of types, which, if we step outside the theory of types, seems to be true about the theory of types. Bothered by this, Tarski took a different approach to the Liar Paradox.

b. Tarski’s Hierarchy of Meta-Languages

Reflection on the Liar Paradox suggests that either informal English (or any other natural language) is not semantically closed or, if it is semantically closed as it appears to be, then it is inconsistent—assuming for the moment that it does make sense to apply the term "inconsistent" to a natural language with a vague structure. Because of the vagueness of natural language, Tarski quit trying to find the paradox-free structure within natural languages and concentrated on developing formal languages that did not allow the deduction of a contradiction, but which diverge from natural language "as little as possible." Tarski emphasized that we should not be investigating a language-unspecific concept of truth, but only truth for a specific formal language. Many other philosophers of logic have not drawn Tarski’s pessimistic conclusion (about not being able to solve the Liar Paradox for natural language). W. V. O. Quine, in particular, argued that informal English can be considered to implicitly contain the hierarchy of Tarski’s metalanguages. This hierarchy is the tool Tarski used to solve the Liar Paradox for formal languages, although he gave no other justification for distinguishing a language from its metalanguage.

One virtue of Tarski's way out of the Paradox is that it does permit the concept of truth to be applied to sentences that involve the concept of truth, provided we apply level subscripts to the concept of truth and follow the semantic rule that any subscript inside, say, a pair of quotation marks is smaller than the subscript outside; any violation of this rule produces a meaningless, ungrammatical formal sentence, but not a false one. The language of level 1 is the meta-language of the object language in level 0. The (semi-formal) sentence "I0 am not true0" violates the subscript rule, as does "I1 am not true1" and so on up the numbered hierarchy. `I0´ is the name of the sentence "I0 am not true0," which is the obvious candidate for being the Strengthened Liar Sentence in level 0, the lowest level. The rule for subscripts stops the formation of either the Classical Liar sentence or the Strengthened Liar Sentence anywhere in the hierarchy. The subscript rule permits forming the Liar-like sentence “I0 am not true1.” That sentence is the closest the Tarski hierarchy can come to having a Liar Sentence, but it is not really the intended Liar Sentence because of the equivocation with the concept of truth, and it is simply false and leads to no paradox.

Russell's solution calls “This sentence is in English” ill-formed, but Tarski's solution does not, so that is a virtue of Tarski's way out. Tarski's clever treatment of the Liar Paradox unfortunately has drawbacks: English has a single word “true,” but Tarski is replacing this with an infinite sequence of truth-like predicates, each of which is satisfied by the truths only of the language below it. Intuitively, a more global truth predicate should be expressible in the language it applies to, so Tarski’s theory cannot make formal sense of remarks such as “The Liar Sentence implies it itself is false” although informally this is a true remark. One hopes to be able to talk truly about one’s own semantic theory. Despite these restrictions and despite the unintuitive and awkward hierarchy, Quine defends Tarski's way out of the Liar Paradox as follows. Like Tarski, he prefers to speak of the Antinomy instead of the Paradox.

Revision of a conceptual scheme is not unprecedented. It happens in a small way with each advance in science, and it happens in a big way with the big advances, such as the Copernican revolution and the shift from Newtonian mechanics to Einstein's theory of relativity. We can hope in time even to get used to the biggest such changes and to find the new schemes natural. There was a time when the doctrine that the earth revolves around the sun was called the Copernican paradox, even by the men who accepted it. And perhaps a time will come when truth locutions without implicit subscripts, or like safeguards, will really sound as nonsensical as the antinomies show them to be. (Quine 1976)

 Tarski adds to the defense by stressing that:

The languages (either the formalized languages or—what is more frequently the case—the portions of everyday language) which are used in scientific discourse do not have to be semantically closed. (Tarski, 1944)

(Kripke 1975) criticized Tarski’s way out for its inability to handle contingent versions of the Liar Paradox because Tarski cannot describe the contingency. That is, Tarski's solution does not provide a way to specify the circumstances in which a sentence leads to a paradox and the other circumstances in which that same sentence is paradox-free.

Putnam criticized Tarski's way out for another reason:

The paradoxical aspect of Tarski’s theory, indeed of any hierarchical theory, is that one has to stand outside the whole hierarchy even to formulate the statement that the hierarchy exists. But what is this “outside place”—“informal language”—supposed to be? It cannot be “ordinary language,” because ordinary language, according to Tarski, is semantically closed and hence inconsistent. But neither can it be a regimented language, for no regimented language can make semantic generalizations about itself or about languages on a higher level than itself. (Putnam 1990, 13)

Within the formal languages, we cannot say, “Every language has true sentences,” even though outside the hierarchy this is clearly a true remark about the hierarchy.

c. Kripke’s Hierarchy of Interpretations

Saul Kripke was the first person to emphasize that the reasoning of ordinary speakers often can produce a Liar Paradox. Statement (1) below can do so. Quoting from (Kripke 1975), "Consider the ordinary statement, made by Jones:

(1) Most (i.e., a majority) of Nixon's assertions about Watergate are false.

Clearly, nothing is intrinsically wrong with (1), nor is it ill-formed. Ordinarily the truth value of (1) will be ascertainable through an enumeration of Nixon's Watergate-related assertions, and an assessment of each for truth or falsity. Suppose, however, that Nixon's assertions about Watergate are evenly balanced between the true and the false, except for one problematic case,

(2) Everything ones says about Watergate is true.

Suppose, in addition, that (1) is Jones's sole assertion about Watergate.... Then it requires little expertise to show that (1) and (2) are both paradoxical: they are true if and only if they are false.

The example of (1) points up an important lesson: it would be fruitless to looks for an intrinsic criterion that will enable us to sieve out—as meaningless, or ill-formed—those sentences which lead to paradox." In that last sentence, Kripke attacks the solutions of Russell and Tarski. The additional lesson to learn from Kripke's example of the Contingent Liar involving Nixon's assertions about Watergate is that if a solution to the Liar Paradox is going to say that certain assertions such as this one fail to have a truth value in some circumstances but not in all circumstances, then the solution should tell us what those circumstances are, other than saying the circumstances are those that lead to a paradox.

Kripke’s way out requires a less radical revision in our semantic principles than does the Russell solution or the Tarski-Quine solution. Kripke retains the intuition that there is a semantically coherent and meaningful Liar Sentence, but argues that it is neither true nor false and so falls into a “truth value gap.” Tarski's Undefinability Theorem does not apply to languages having sentences that are neither true nor false.

Kripke trades Russell's and Tarski's infinite complexity of languages for infinite semantic complexity of a single formal language. He rejects Tarski's infinite hierarchy of meta-languages in favor of one formal language having an infinite hierarchy of partial interpretations. Consider a formal language containing a predicate T for truth (that is, for truth-in-an interpretation, although Kripke allows the interpretation to change throughout the hierarchy). In the base level of the hierarchy, this predicate T is given an interpretation in which it is true of all sentences that do not actually contain the symbol ‘T’. The predicate T is the formal language’s only basic partially-interpreted predicate. Each step up Kripke’s semantic hierarchy is a partial interpretation of the language, and in these interpretations all the basic predicates except one must have their interpretations already fixed in the base level from which the first step up the hierarchy is taken. This one exceptional predicate T is intended to be the truth predicate for the previous lower level.

For example, at the lowest level in the hierarchy we have the (formal equivalent of the) true sentence 7 + 5 = 12. Strictly speaking it is not grammatical in English to say 7 + 5 = 12 is true. More properly we should add quotation marks and say ‘7 + 5 = 12’ is true. In Kripke’s formal language, ‘7 + 5 = 12’ is true at the base level of the hierarchy. Meanwhile, the sentence that says it is true, namely ‘T(‘7+5=12’)’, is not true at that level, although it is true at the next higher level. Unfortunately at this new level, the even more complex sentence ‘T(‘T(‘7+5=12’)’)’ is still not yet true. It will become true at the next higher level. And so goes the hierarchy of interpretations as it attributes truth to more and more sentences involving the concept of truth itself. The extension of T, that is, the class of names of sentences that satisfy T, grows but never contracts as we move up the hierarchy, and it grows by calling more true sentences true. Similarly the anti-extension of T grows but never contracts as more false sentence involving T are correctly said to be false.

Kripke says T eventually becomes a truth predicate for its own level when the interpretation-building reaches the unique lowest fixed point at a countably infinite height in the hierarchyAt a fixed point, no new sentences are declared true or false at the next level, but the language satisfies Tarski’s Convention T, so for this reason many philosophers are sympathetic to Kripke’s claim that T is a truth predicate at that point. At this fixed point, the Liar Sentence still is neither true nor false, and so falls into the truth gap, just as Kripke set out to show. In this way, the Liar Paradox is solved, the formal semantics is coherent, and many of our intuitions about semantics are preserved. Regarding our intuition that is expressed in Convention T, a virtue of Kripke's theory is that, if ‘p’ abbreviates the name of the sentence X, it follows that Tp is true (or false) just in case X is true (or false).

However, there are difficulties with Kripke's way out. The treatment of the Classical Liar stumbles on the Strengthened Liar and reveals why that paradox deserves its name.  For a discussion of why, see (Kirkham 1992, pp. 293-4).

Some critics of Kripke's theory say that in the fixed-point the Liar Sentence does not actually contain a real, total truth predicate but rather only a clever restriction on the truth predicate, and so Kripke’s Liar Sentence is not really the Liar Sentence after all; therefore we do not have here a solution to the Liar Paradox. Other philosophers would say this is not a fair criticism of Kripke's theory since Tarski's Convention T, or some other intuitive feature of our concept of truth, must be restricted in some way if we are going to have a formal treatment of truth. What can more easily be agreed upon by the critics is that Kripke's candidate for the Liar sentence falls into the truth gap in Kripke's theory at all levels of his hierarchy, so it is not true in his theory. [We are making this judgment that it is not true from within the meta-language in which sentences are properly said to be true or else not true.] However, in the object language of the theory, one cannot truthfully say this; one cannot say the Liar Sentence is not true since the candidate expression for that, namely ~Ts, is not true, but rather falls into the truth gap.

Robert Martin and Peter Woodruff created the same way out as Kripke, though a few months earlier and in less depth.

d. Barwise and Etchemendy

Another way out says the Liar Sentence is meaningful and is true or else false, but one step of the argument in the Liar Paradox is incorrect (such as the inference from the Liar Sentence’s being false to its being true). Arthur Prior, following the informal suggestions of Jean Buridan and C. S. Peirce, takes this way out and concludes that the Liar Sentence is simply false.  So do Jon Barwise and John Etchemendy, but they go on to present a detailed, formal treatment of the Paradox that depends crucially upon using propositions rather than sentences, although the details of their treatment will not be sketched here. Their treatment says the Liar Sentence is simply false on one interpretation but simply true on another interpretation, and that the argument of the Paradox improperly exploits this ambiguity. The key ambiguity is to conflate the Liar Proposition's negating itself with its denying itself. Similarly, in ordinary language we are not careful to distinguish asserting that a sentence is false and denying that it is true.

Three positive features of their solution are that (i) it is able to solve the Strengthened Liar, (ii) its propositions are always true or false, but never both, and (iii) it shows the way out of paradox both for natural language and interpreted formal language. Yet there is a price to pay. No proposition in their system can be about the whole world, and this restriction is there for no independent reason but only because otherwise we would get a paradox.

e. Paraconsistency

A more radical way out of the Paradox is to argue that the Liar Sentence is both true and false. This solution, a version of dialethism, embraces the contradiction, then tries to limit the damage that is ordinarily a consequence of that embrace. This way out changes the classical rules of semantics and allows, among other things,  the Liar Sentence to be both true and false, and it changes the syntactic rules of classical logic and revises modus ponens to prevent there being a theorem that everything follows from a contradiction: (p&¬p) ⊢ q.

This way out uses a paraconsistent logic. That solution, which was initially promoted mostly by Graham Priest, will not be developed in this article, but it succeeds in avoiding semantic incoherence while offering a formal, detailed treatment of the Paradox. A principal virtue of this treatment is that, unlike with Barwise and Etchemendy's treatment, a sentence can be about the whole world. A principal drawback of this treatment, though, is it doesn't seem to solve the Strengthened Liar Paradox and it does violence to our intuition that sentences can’t be both true and false in the same sense in the same situation. See the last paragraph of "Paradoxes of Self-Reference," for more discussion of using paraconsistency as a way out of the Liar Paradox.

4. Conclusion

Russell, Tarski, Kripke, Priest, Barwise and Etchemendy (among others) deserve credit for providing a philosophical justification for their proposed solutions while also providing a formal treatment in symbolic logic that shows in detail both the character and implications of their proposed solutions. The theories of Russell and of Quine-Tarski do solve the Strengthened Liar, but at the cost of assigning complex “levels” to the relevant sentences, although the Quine-Tarski solution does not take Russell’s radical step of ruling out all self-reference. Kripke’s elegant and careful treatment of the Classical Liar stumbles on the Strengthened Liar and reveals why that paradox deserves its name.  Barwise and Etchemendy’s way out avoids these problems, but it requires accepting the idea that no sentence can be used to say anything about the whole world including the semantics of our language. Priest’s way out requires giving up our intuition that no context-free, unambiguous sentence is both true and false.

The interesting dispute  continues over which is the best way out of the Liar Paradox—the best way to preserve the most important intuitions we have about semantics while avoiding semantic incoherence. In this vein, Hilary Putnam draws the following conclusion:

If you want to say something about the liar sentence, in the sense of being able to give final answers to the questions “Is it meaningful or not? And if it is meaningful, is it true or false? Does it express a proposition or not? Does it have a truth-value or not? And which one?” then you will always fail. In closing, let me say that even if Tarski was wrong (as I believe he was) in supposing that ordinary language is a theory and hence can be described as “consistent” or “inconsistent,” and even if Kripke and others have shown that it is possible to construct languages that contain their own truth-predicates, still, the fact remains that the totality of our desires with respect to how a truth-predicate should behave in a semantically closed language, in particular, our desire to be able to say without paradox of an arbitrary sentence in such a language that it is true, or that it is false, or that it is neither true nor false, cannot be adequately satisfied. The very act of interpreting a language that contains a liar sentence creates a hierarchy of interpretations, and the reflection that this generates does not terminate in an answer to the questions “Is the liar sentence meaningful or meaningless, or if it is meaningful, is it true or false?” (Putnam 2000)

See also Logical Paradoxes.

5. References and Further Reading

For further reading on the Liar Paradox that provides more of an introduction to it while not presupposing a strong background in symbolic logic, the author recommends the article below by Mates, plus the first chapter of the Barwise-Etchemendy book, and then chapter 9 of the Kirkham book. The rest of this bibliography is a list of contributions to research on the Liar Paradox, and all members of the list require the reader to have significant familiarity with the techniques of symbolic logic. In the formal, symbolic tradition, other important researchers in the last quarter of the 20th century were Burge, Gupta, Herzberger, McGee, Parsons, Routley, Skyrms, van Fraassen, and Yablo.

  • Barwise, Jon and John Etchemendy. The Liar: An Essay in Truth and Circularity, Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Beall, J.C. (2001). “Is Yablo’s Paradox Non-Circular?” Analysis 61, no. 3, pp. 176-87.
  • Burge, Tyler. “Semantical Paradox,” Journal of Philosophy, 76 (1979), 169-198.
  • Dowden, Bradley. “Accepting Inconsistencies from the Paradoxes,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 125-130.
  • Gupta, Anil. “Truth and Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 11 (1982), 1-60. Reprinted in Martin (1984), 175-236.
  • Herzberger, Hans. “Paradoxes of Grounding in Semantics,” Journal of Philosophy, 68 (1970), 145-167.
  • Kirkham, Richard. Theories of Truth: A Critical Introduction, MIT Press, 1992.
  • Kripke, Saul. “Outline of a Theory of Truth,” Journal of Philosophy, 72 (1975), 690-716. Reprinted in (Martin 1984).
  • Martin, Robert. The Paradox of the Liar, Yale University Press, Ridgeview Press, 1970. 2nd ed. 1978.
  • Martin, Robert. Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar Paradox, Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Martin, Robert and Peter Woodruff. “On Representing ‘True-in-L’ in L,” Philosophia, 5 (1975), 217-221.
  • Mates, Benson. “Two Antinomies,” in Skeptical Essays, The University of Chicago Press, 1981, 15-57.
  • McGee, Vann. Truth, Vagueness, and Paradox: An Essay on the Logic of Truth, Hackett Publishing, 1991.
  • Priest, Graham. “The Logic of Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8 (1979), 219-241; and “Logic of Paradox Revisited,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 153-179.
  • Priest, Graham, Richard Routley, and J. Norman (eds.). Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent, Philosophia-Verlag, 1989.
  • Prior, Arthur. “Epimenides the Cretan,” Journal of Symbolic Logic, 23 (1958), 261-266; and “On a Family of Paradoxes,” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 2 (1961), 16-32.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Realism with a Human Face, Harvard University Press, 1990.
  • Putnam, Hilary. “Paradox Revisited I: Truth.” In Gila Sher and Richard Tieszen, eds., Between Logic and Intuition: Essays in Honor of Charles Parsons, Cambridge University Press,  (2000), 3-15.
  • Quine, W. V. O. “The Ways of Paradox,” in his The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays, rev. ed., Harvard University Press, 1976.
  • Russell, Bertrand. “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types,” American Journal of Mathematics, 30 (1908), 222-262.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Logic and Knowledge: Essays 1901-1950, ed. by Robert C. Marsh, George Allen & Unwin Ltd. (1956).
  • Skyrms, Brian. “Return of the Liar: Three-valued Logic and the Concept of Truth,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 7 (1970), 153-161.
  • Strawson, P. F. “Truth,” in Analysis, 9, (1949).
  • Tarski, Alfred. “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages,” in Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics, pp. 152-278, Clarendon Press, 1956.
  • Tarski, Alfred. “The Semantic Conception of Truth and the Foundations of Semantics,” in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 4, No. 3 (1944), 341-376.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas. “Truth and Paradoxical Consequences,” in (Martin 1970).
  • Woodruff, Peter. “Paradox, Truth and Logic Part 1: Paradox and Truth,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 213-231.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, Basil Blackwell, 3rd edition, 1978.
  • Yablo, Stephen. (1993). “Paradox without Self-Reference.” Analysis 53: 251-52.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.

Philosophy of Language

Those who use the term "philosophy of language" typically use it to refer to work within the field of Anglo-American analytical philosophy and its roots in German and Austrian philosophy of the early twentieth century. Many philosophers outside this tradition have views on the nature and use of language, and the border between "analytical" and "continental" philosophy is becoming more porous with time, but most who speak of this field are appealing to a specific set of traditions, canonical authors and methods. The article takes this more narrow focus in order to describe a tradition's history, but readers should bear in mind this restriction of scope.

The history of the philosophy of language in the analytical tradition begins with advances in logic and with tensions within traditional accounts of the mind and its contents at the end of the nineteenth century. A revolution of sorts resulted from these developments, often known as the "Linguistic Turn" in philosophy. However, its early programs ran into serious difficulties by mid-twentieth century, and significant changes in direction came about as a result. Section 1 below addresses the precursors and early stages of the "Linguistic Turn," while Section 2 addresses its development by the Logical Positivists and others. Section 3 outlines the sudden shifts that resulted from the works of Quine and Wittgenstein, and Section 4 charts the major approaches and figures that have followed from mid-century to the present.

Table of Contents

  1. Frege, Russell and the Linguistic Turn
    1. Referential Theories of Meaning
    2. Frege on Sense and Reference
    3. Russell
  2. Early Analytical Philosophy of Language
    1. The Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus
    2. The Vienna Circle and the Logical Positivists
    3. Tarski's Theory of Truth
  3. Mid-century Revolutions
    1. Quine and the Analytic/Synthetic Distinction
    2. The Later Wittgenstein
  4. Major Areas in the Contemporary Field
    1. Truth-Conditional Theories of Meaning
    2. Meaning and Use
    3. Speech Act Theory and Pragmatics
  5. Future Directions and Emerging Debates
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Frege, Russell and the Linguistic Turn

a. Referential Theories of Meaning

Much of the stage-setting for the so-called "Linguistic Turn" in Anglo-American philosophy took place in the mid nineteenth century. Attention turned to language as many came to see it as a focal point in understanding belief and representation of the world. Language came to be seen as the "medium of conceptualization," as Wilfrid Sellars would later put it. Idealists working in Kant's wake had developed more sophisticated "transcendental" accounts of the conditions for the possibility of experience, and this evoked strong reactions from more realist philosophers and those sympathetic to the natural sciences. Scientists also made advances in the 1860s and 70s in describing cognitive functions like speech production and comprehension as natural phenomena, including the discovery of Broca's area and Wernicke's area, two neural centers of linguistic activity.

John Stuart Mill's work around this time reinvigorated British empiricism and included an approach to language that traced the meanings of individual words to the objects to which they referred (see 1843, 1, 2, sec. 5). Mill's empiricism led him to think that for meaning to have any significance for our thought and understanding, we must explain it in terms of our experience. Thus, meaning should ultimately be understood in terms of words standing for sets of sense impressions. Not all those concerned with language shared Mill's empiricist leanings, though most shared his sense that denotation, rather than connotation, should be at the center of an account of meaning. A word denotes something by standing for it, as my name stands for me, or "Baltimore" stands for a particular city on America's East Coast; a word connotes something when it "implies an attribute" in Mill's terms, as "professor" generally implies an expert in an academic field and someone with certain sorts of institutional authority. For most expressions, philosophers thought that to grasp their meaning was to know what they stood for, as we often think of proper names serving simply as labels for the things they denote. (Mill also tended to use "meaning" in talking about connotation, and might have reservations with saying that proper names had "meanings," though this is not to deny that they denote things.) Thus,

(1) The cat sat on the refrigerator.

should be understood as a complex arrangement of signs. "The cat" denotes or refers to a particular furry domesticated quadruped, "the refrigerator" denotes something, and so forth. Some further elaboration would be needed for verbs, logical vocabulary and other categories of terms, but most philosophers took the backbone of an account of meaning to be denotation, and language use to be a process of the management of signs. These signs might denote objects directly, or they might do so indirectly by standing for something within our minds, following Locke, who described words as "signs of ideas" (1690, III, 1).

Accounts that emphasized the reference of terms as constitutive of the meaning of most expressions faced two serious problems, however. First, they failed to explain the possibility of non-referring terms and negative existential sentences. On such a referential picture of meaning, the meaning of most expressions would simply be their bearers, so an existential sentence like

(2) John Coltrane plays saxophone.

was easy to analyze. Its subject term, "John Coltrane," referred to a particular person and the sentence says of him that he does a particular sort of thing: he plays saxophone. But what of a sentence like

(3) Phlogiston was thought to be the cause of combustion.

Assuming that there is not and never was such a thing as phlogiston, how can we understand such a sentence? If the meaning of those expressions is their referent, then this sentence should strike us as meaningless. Meinong (1904) suggested that such expressions denote entities that "subsist," but do not exist, by which he granted them a sort of reality, albeit one outside the actual universe. The majority of philosophers treated this with suspicion. Others suggested that the expression above denotes the concept or idea of "phlogiston." The difficulty facing such responses comes into sharper relief with consideration of negative existentials.

(4) Atlantis does not exist.

If Atlantis does not exist, the expression "Atlantis" does not refer to anything and would have no meaning. One could say that "Atlantis" refers not to a sunken city, but to our concept of a sunken city. But this has the paradoxical result of making (4) false, since the concept is there for us to refer to, thus rendering it impossible to deny. This might even entail that we could not truthfully deny the existence of anything of which we could conceive, which seems implausible.

The second serious problem for referential theories of meaning, noted by Frege (1892), was the informativeness of some identity sentences. Sentences of self-identity are true purely in virtue of their logical form, and we may affirm them even when we do not know what the expression refers to. For instance, anyone could affirm

(5) Mt. Kilimanjaro is Mt. Kilimanjaro.

even if they do not know what Mt. Kilimanjaro is. Making this statement in such a case would not inform our understanding of the world in any significant way. However, a sentence like

(6) Mt. Kilimanjaro is the tallest mountain in Africa.

would certainly be informative to those who first heard it. But remember that according to referential theories of meaning, "Mt. Kilimanjaro" and "the tallest mountain in Africa" refer to the same thing and hence mean the same thing according to these theories; therefore, (5) and (6) say the same thing and one should be no more or less informative than the other. Where we grasp the meaning of an expression or a sentence, philosophers have traditionally taken it that this should make some sort of cognitive difference, for example, we should be able to perform an action, make an inference, recognize something, and so on. Thus differences in the meanings of expressions should be reflected by some difference in cognitive significance between the expressions. But if expressions refer to the same thing, and their meaning consists solely in their picking out a referent, then there should be no such cognitive difference even if there is apparently a difference in meaning. Simple referential theories do not offer us an obvious solution to this problem and therefore fail to capture important intuitions about meaning.

b. Frege on Sense and Reference

To address these problems, Frege proposed that we should think of expressions as having two semantic aspects: a sense and a reference. The sense of an expression would be its "mode of presentation," as Frege put it, that conveyed information to us in its own distinct way. That information would in turn determine a referent for each expression. This led to a credo pervasive in analytical philosophy: sense determines reference. This solved problems of reference by shifting the emphasis to the sense of expressions first and to their reference later. Negative existential sentences were intelligible because the sense of an expression like "largest prime number" or "Atlantis" could be logically analyzed or made explicit in terms of other descriptions, even if the set of things specified by this information was, in fact, empty. Our belief that these sentences and expressions were meaningful was a consequence of grasping their senses, even when we realized this left them without a referent. As Frege put it:

It can perhaps be granted that an expression has a sense if it is formed in a grammatically correct manner and stands for a proper name. But as to whether there is a denotation corresponding to the connotation is hereby not decided… [T]he grasping of a sense does not with certainty warrant a corresponding nominatum. [that is, referent] (1892: p. 153 in Beaney (1997))

The informativeness of some identity claims also became clearer. In a sentence like (5), we are simply stating self-identity, but in a sentence like (6), we express something of real cognitive significance, containing extensions of our knowledge that cannot generally be shown a priori. This would not be a trivial matter of logical form like "A=A," but a discovery that two very different senses determined the same referent, which would suggest important conceptual connections between different ideas, inform further inferences, and thus enlighten us in various ways. Even if "Mt. Kilimanjaro" and "the tallest mountain in Africa" refer to the same thing, it would be informative to learn that they do, and we would augment our understanding of the world by learning this.

Frege also noted expressions which shared their referents could generally be substituted for one another without changing the truth value of a sentence. For instance, "Elvis Costello" and "Declan McManus" refer to the same object, and so if "Elvis Costello was born in Liverpool" is true, so is, "Declan McManus was born in Liverpool." Anything that we might predicate of the one, we may predicate of the other, so long as the two expressions co-refer. However, Frege realized that there were certain contexts in which this substitutability failed, or at least could not be guaranteed. For instance,

(7) Liz knows that Elvis Costello was born in Liverpool.

may be true, even when

(8) Liz knows that Declan McManus was born in Liverpool.

is false, especially in cases where Liz does not know that Elvis Costello is Declan McManus, or never learns the latter name at all. What has happened here? Note that (7) and (8) both include strings of words that could be sentences in their own right ("Elvis Costello was born in Liverpool" and "Declan McManus was born in Liverpool"). "Liz knows that…" expresses something about those propositions (namely, Liz's attitude towards them). Frege suggested that in these cases, the reference of those embedded sentences is not a truth value, as it would customarily be, but is rather the sense of the sentence itself. Someone might grasp the sense of one sentence but not another, and hence sentences like (7) and (8) could vary in their truth values. Frege called these "indirect" contexts, and Quine would later dub such cases "opaque" contexts.

Rudolf Carnap would later replace the term "sense" with "intension" and "reference" with "extension." Carnap's terminology became prevalent in formal analysis of semantics by the 1950s, though it was Frege's original insights that drove the field. Significant worries remained for the Fregean notion of sense, however. Names and other expressions in natural languages rarely have fixed sets of descriptions that are universally acknowledged as Frege's senses would have to be. Frege might reply that he had no intention of making sense a matter of public consensus or psychological regularity, but this makes the status of a sense all the more mysterious, as well as our capacity to grasp them. Analytical philosophers of language would struggle with this for decades to come.

Still, Frege had effectively redrawn the map for philosophy. By introducing senses as a focal point of analysis, he had carved out a distinct territory for philosophical inquiry. Senses were not simply psychological entities, since they were both commonly accessible by different speakers and had a normative dimension to them, prescribing correct usage rather than simply describing performance. (See Frege (1884) for a thorough attack on psychologistic accounts of meaning.) Nor were they the causal and mechanical objects of natural science, reducible to accounts of lawlike regularity. They were entities playing a logical and cognitive role, and would be both explanatory of conceptual content and universal across natural languages, unlike the empirical details of linguistics and anthropology. Thus, there was a project for philosophy to undertake, separate from the natural sciences, and it was the logical analysis of the underlying structure of meaning. Though naturalistic concerns would be reasserted in the development of analytical philosophy, Frege's project would come to dominate Anglo-American philosophy for much of the next century.

c. Russell

An important bridge between Frege and the English-speaking world was Bertrand Russell's "On Denoting" (1905). Both men were mathematicians by training and shared a concern with the foundations of arithmetic. However, Russell shared a sense with some earlier philosophers that at least some expressions were meaningful in virtue of direct reference, contra Frege. Still, Russell saw the potential in Frege's work and undertook an analysis of singular definite descriptions. These are complex expressions that purport to single out a particular referent by providing a description, for example, "the President of the USA," or "the tallest person in this room right now." Russell wondered how

(9) The present King of France is bald.

could be meaningful, given the absence of a present King of France. Russell's solution was to analyze the logical role of such descriptions. Although a select few expressions referred directly to objects, most were either descriptions that picked out a referent by offering a list of properties, or disguised abbreviations of such descriptions. Russell even suggested that most proper names were abbreviated descriptions. Strictly speaking, descriptions would not refer at all; they would be quantified phrases that had or lacked extensions. What was needed was an account that could explain the meaning of descriptions in terms of the propositions that they abbreviated. Russell (1905) analyzed sentence (9) as implying three things that jointly gave us a definition of propositions involving descriptions. (A more succinct presentation comes in Russell (1919).) A sentence like "The author of Waverley was Scotch" involves three logical constituents:

(10) "x wrote Waverley" is not always false (i.e at least one person wrote Waverley)

(11) "if x and y wrote Waverley , x and y are identical" is always true (that is, at most one person wrote Waverley)

(12) "if x wrote Waverley, x was Scotch" is always true (that is, whoever wrote Waverley was Scotch)

The first two here effectively assert the existence and uniqueness of the referent of this expression, respectively. We may generalize them and express them as a single proposition of the form "There is a term c such that Fx is true when x is c, and Fx is false when x is not c." (Thus, F is held uniquely by c.) This asserts that there is a unique satisfier of the description given or implied by an expression, and this may be true or false depending on the expression at hand. We can then tack on an additional condition expressing whatever property is attributed to the referent (being bald, Scotch, and so on) in the form "c has the property Y." If nothing has the property F thus analyzed, (such as "being the present King of France" in (9) above) then "c has the property Y" is false, and we have a means to analyze non-denoting expressions. Such expressions are actually to be understood as quantified phrases and we may understand them as having objects over which they quantify or lacking such objects; the grasp of the logical structure of those phrases is what constitutes our understanding of them. While we grasp each of the parts abbreviated by the expression, we also understand that one of them is false—there is no unique satisfier of "the present King of France"—and thus we can understand the sentence "The present king of France is bald" even though one of its terms does not refer. That expression can have a significant occurrence once we understand it as an "incomplete" or "complex" symbol whose meaning is derived from its constituents. Most proper names, and indeed almost all expressions in a natural language, would submit to such an analysis, and Russell's work thus kick-started analytical philosophy in the English-speaking world. (Significant contributions were also made by G.E. Moore in the fields of epistemology and ethics and hence he is often mentioned along with Russell, but Moore's achievements are largely outside the scope of our focus here.)

2. Early Analytical Philosophy of Language

The achievements of Russell and Frege in setting an agenda for analytical philosophers that promised to both resolve longstanding philosophical difficulties and preserve a role for philosophy on an equal footing with the natural sciences electrified European and American academic philosophers. The following section focuses on three points of interest in the early phases of this tradition: (1) the early work of Ludwig Wittgenstein; (2) the Logical Positivists; and (3) Tarski's theory of truth.

a. The Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus

Ludwig Wittgenstein came to read Frege and Russell out of an interest in the foundations of mathematics and went to Cambridge to study with Russell. He studied there, but left to serve in the Austro-Hungarian army in 1914. While being held as a prisoner of war, he wrote drafts of a text that many saw as the high-water mark of early analytical philosophy, the Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. In it, he wrote seven propositions and made extensive comments on six of them, with extensive comments on the comments, and so forth. He laid out a parsimonious and ambitious plan to systematically realize Frege and Russell's aspirations of analyzing the logical structure of language and thought.

Through logical analysis, Wittgenstein held that we could arrive at a conception of language as consisting of elementary propositions related by the now-familiar elements of first-order logic. Any sentence with a sense could have that sense perspicuously rendered in such a system, and any sentence that did not yield to such analysis would not have a sense at all. "Everything that can be thought at all can be thought clearly. Everything that can be said can be said clearly." (1922, §4.116) Wittgenstein's claim here is not that we cannot string together words in unclear ways; indeed, we do that all the time. Rather, in doing so, we do not express anything that has a sense. What we say may get nods of approval from fellow speakers, and we may even be grasping at something important, but what we say does not convey anything meaningful.

In part, this reflects Wittgenstein's early view that propositions "pictured" the world. This is not to say that a written inscription or a verbal utterance of a sentence visually resembles that state of affairs it expresses. "Elvin Jones played drums for John Coltrane" looks like neither Elvin Jones, nor John Coltrane, nor a drum set. Rather, the form of a proposition resembled the form of some fact of the world. What was required to understand this as a picture of the world was just what was needed in the case of actual pictures—a coordination of the elements in the picture with objects outside itself. (Logical truths would be true in virtue of relations among their propositions.) Where we could do this, the language was stating something clearly; where we could not, despite our best efforts, the words were not saying anything at all. However, this was not to say that everything about meaning and our understanding of the world was a matter of explicit definition, that is, something we could say. Rather than being said with our language, many things can only be shown. For instance, think of a logical expression like "and." Any attempt to explain its sense, like putting two things side by side, or using another term like "both," only recapitulates the structure of "and," thus adding nothing. The form of our propositions shows how it works and we cannot say anything more informative about it. Wittgenstein also espoused a number of views at the end of the Tractatus on solipsism, the will and ethics, and what could be said about them, but these remain some of the most difficult and contested points of interpretation in his work. Wittgenstein took himself to have prescribed the limits of what philosophy could say, and closed the Tractatus without further comment by saying, "Whereof we cannot speak, we must remain silent." (1922, §7)

b. The Vienna Circle and the Logical Positivists

Beginning in 1907, a group of European professors originally known as the Ernst Mach Society began to meet regularly for discussions on matters of logic, philosophy and science under the guidance of Moritz Schlick. They later took to calling themselves the Vienna Circle and their ongoing conversations became the nascence of a movement known as Logical Positivism, which would include Carl Hempel, Rudolf Carnap, and Hans Reichenbach, among many others. They rejected the Hegelian idealism prevalent in European academic circles, espoused the austere precision of science, particularly physics, as a model for their methods, and took the phenomenalist strains of British empiricism as a more suitable epistemological foundation for such goals. Carnap adopted the insights of Frege's work and brought tremendous sophistication to the analytical enterprise, particularly in his The Logical Structure of the World (1928). The Logical Positivists also took inspiration from Wittgenstein's Tractatus, but their fidelity to his more abstruse aims is tenuous at best. They shared Wittgenstein's view that logical proofs were true in virtue of internal relations among their propositions, not by virtue of any actual facts about the world, and parsed this as support for a renewed version of the analytic/synthetic distinction. Analytic sentences were those true solely in virtue of the meanings of their constituent expressions ("All bachelors are unmarried") while synthetic sentences were true partly in virtue of empirical facts beyond the meanings of their constituent terms ("Flynn is a bachelor"). Analytic sentences would be confirmed by logical analysis, while synthetic sentences would be confirmed by appeal to observation sentences, or to sense-data in even more rigorous accounts.

This led the Positivists to the Verificationist Theory of Meaning. Analytic sentences would be true in virtue of the meanings of their terms, while all synthetic sentences would have to admit to some sort of empirical verification criteria. Any sentence that could not be verified by one or the other of these means was deemed meaningless. This excluded claims with mystical or occult import, but also large areas of ethics and metaphysics as practiced by many philosophers. Schlick (1933) put it boldly, saying:

[A] proposition has a statable meaning only if it makes a verifiable difference whether it is true or false. A proposition which is such that the world remains the same whether it is true or false simply says nothing about the world; it is empty and communicates nothing; I can give it no meaning. We have a verifiable difference, however, only when it is a difference in the given… (Ayer 1959, p. 88)

By "given" here, Schlick alluded to the stream of sense-data that come before us. Few if any sentences were understood in such ways by most speakers, so the work of philosophy was logical analysis and definition of the concepts of the natural sciences into verificationist terms. While one could imagine empirical verification of many things in the physical sciences (for example, laboratory results, predictions with observable consequences), it would be far more difficult in fields like psychology and ethics. In these cases, the Positivists favored a type of logical reductionism for the pertinent sentences in the discourse. All sentences and key concepts in psychology would be reduced to empirically verifiable sentences about the behavior of thinking subjects, for instance. A sentence about a mental state like anger would be reduced to sentences about observable behavior such as raising one's voice, facial expressions, becoming violent, and so on. This would require "bridge laws" or sentences of theoretical identity to equate the entities of, say, psychology with the entities of the physical sciences and thus translate the terms of older theories into new ones. (Again, in some cases the preferred mode would be to equate them directly with sense-data.) Where this could not be done, the Positivists took it that the sentences in question were meaningless, and they advocated the elimination of many canonical concepts, sentences and theories, derisively lumped under the term "metaphysics." A sentence like "God exists outside of space and time" was certainly not true in virtue of the meanings of its terms and did not admit to any sort of empirical test, so it would be dismissed as gibberish.

The Verificationist theory of meaning ran into great difficulty almost immediately, often due to objections among the Positivists. For one, any sentence stating the theory itself was neither analytical, nor subject to empirical verification, so it would seem to be either self-refuting or meaningless. Universal generalizations including scientific laws like "All electrons have a charge of 1.6x10-19 coulombs" were also problematic, since they were not deducible from finite sets of observation sentences. (See Hempel (1950), esp. §2.1) Counterfactual sentences, such as "If we dropped this sugar cube in water, it would dissolve," present similar problems. Efforts at refinement continued, though dissatisfaction with the whole program was growing by mid-century.

c. Tarski's Theory of Truth

In two seminal works (1933 and 1944), Alfred Tarski made a great leap forward for the rigorous analysis of meaning, showing that semantics could be treated just as systematically as syntax could. Syntax, the rules and structures governing the recombination of words and phrases into sentences, had been analyzed with some success by logicians, but semantic notions like "meaning" or "truth" defied such efforts for many years.

Tarski sought an analysis of the concept of truth that would contain no explicit or implicit appeals to inherently semantic notions, and offered a definition of it in terms of syntax and set theory. He began by distinguishing metalanguage and object language; an object language is the language (natural or formal) that is our target for analysis, while the metalanguage is the language in which we conduct our analysis. Metalanguage is the language that we use to study another language, and the object language is the language that we study. For instance, children learning a second language typically take classes conducted in their mother tongue that treat the second language as an object to be studied. Thus, copies of all the sentences of the object language should be included in the metalanguage and the metalanguage should include sufficient resources to describe the syntax of the object language, as well. In effect, an object language would not contain its own truth predicate—this could only occur in a metalanguage, since it requires speakers to talk about sentences themselves, rather than actually using them. There is great controversy about the shape that a metalanguague would have to take to enable analysis of a natural language, and Tarski openly doubted that these methods would transfer easily from formal to natural languages, but we will not delve into these issues here.

Tarski argued that a definition of truth would have to be "formally correct" or as he put it:

(14) For all x, True(x) iff Fx.

or a sentence provably equivalent to this, where "true" was not part of F. This much was a largely formal condition, but Tarski added a more robust call for "material adequacy" or a sense that our definition had succeeded in capturing the sorts of correspondence between states of affairs and sentences classically associated with truth. So, for instance, our truth definition had to imply a sentence like:

(15) "Snow is white" is true iff snow is white.

Note that the quotes here make the first half of this metalanguage sentence about the object language sentence "Snow is white"; the second half of the metalanguage sentence is about snow itself. Tarski then offered a definition of truth

"A sentence is true if it is satisfied by all objects and false otherwise." (1944, p. 353)

where satisfaction is a relation between arbitrary objects and sentential functions, and sentential functions are expressions with a formal structure much like ordinary sentences, but which contain free variables, for example, "x is blue" or "x is greater than y." Tarski thought we might indicate which objects satisfied the simplest sentential functions and then offer a further set of conditions under which compound functions were satisfied in terms of those simple functions. (Further refinements were made to a 1956 edition of the paper to accommodate certain features of model theory that we will not discuss here.) Once Tarksi added an inductive definition of the other operators of first-order logic, a definition of truth had apparently been given without appeal to inherently semantic notions, though Field (1972) would argue that "designation" and "satisfaction" were semantic notions as well. Whether this should be read as a deflationary account of truth or an analysis of a robust correspondence theory was a point of great debate among analytical philosophers, but much like Frege's earlier work, it played the far more momentous role of convincing further generations of logicians and philosophers that the analysis of traditionally intractable philosophical notions with the tools of modern logic was both within their grasp and immensely rewarding.

3. Mid-century Revolutions

By the middle of the 20th century, the approach spawned by Frege, Moore and Russell had taken root with the Logical Positivists. The Second World War did a great deal to scatter the most talented philosophers from the Continent, and many settled at universities in Great Britain and the United States, spreading their views and influencing generations of philosophers to come. However, the analytical tradition always had a robust streak of criticism from within, and some of the pillars of the early orthodoxy were already under some suspicion from members of the Vienna Circle like Otto Neurath (see his (1933)) and gadflies like Karl Popper. The next section addresses the work of two figures, Quine and the later Wittgenstein, who challenged received views in the philosophy of language and served as transitional figures for contemporary views.

a. Quine and the Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

W.V.O. Quine (1953) went after the very core of Logical Positivism, and in effect analytical philosophy, by attacking the analytic/synthetic distinction. The Positivists had been happy to admit a distinction between sentences that were true in virtue of the meanings of their terms and those that were true in virtue of the facts, but Quine brought a certain skepticism about the meanings of individual expressions to the table. Much like the Positivists, he was wary of anything that would not admit to empirical confirmation and saw meaning as one more such item.

Quine dismissed the idea of a meaning as a real item somehow present in our minds beyond the ways in which it manifests itself in our behavior. He later dubbed this "the myth of the museum"—a place "in which the exhibits are the meanings and the words are the labels." (1969, p. 27) In a strongly empiricist spirit, he argued that we have no access to such things in our experience, thus they could not explain our linguistic behavior, and therefore they had no rightful place in our account. Quine wondered whether there was a principled distinction between analytic and synthetic statements at all. In reviewing the prevailing ideas of analyticity, he found each one inadequate or question-begging. Analyticity was a dogma, an article of faith among empiricists (especially Logical Positivists) and one that could not stand closer scrutiny. Moreover, the Positivists paired analyticity with a second dogma, empirical reductionism, the view that each sentence or expression could be assigned its own distinctive slice of empirical content from our experience. Quine's claim was not that we should not be empiricists or worry about such empirical content, but rather that no individual sentence or expression could be allotted such content all on its own. The sentences of our language operate in conjunction with one another to "face the tribunal of experience" as a whole. This holism entailed a certain egalitarianism among the sentences to which we commit ourselves, as well. Any claim could be held true, come what may, if we were willing to revise other parts of our "web of belief" to accommodate it, and any claim—even one we took to be a claim about meaning before, like "all bachelors are unmarried"—could be revised if conditions demanded it. (1953, p.43) Some sentences would have a relatively strong immunity from revision, for example, the laws of logic, but they enjoy that status only because of their centrality in our present ways of thinking. Other, less central claims could be revised more easily, perhaps with only passing interest, for example, claims about the number of red brick houses on Elm St. This wide-open revisability came to set a tone for epistemology in analytical philosophy during the latter half of the 20th century.

Without tidy parcels of empirical content or analytic truths to anchor an account of meaning, Quine saw little use for meaning at all. Instead, his work focused on co-reference and assent among speakers. In Word and Object (1960), he suggested that our position as speakers is much like that of a field linguist attempting to translate a newly discovered language with no discernible connections to other local languages. He dubbed this approach "radical translation." Faced with such a situation, we would search for recurring expressions and attempt to secure referents for them. In his classic example, we stand around with the locals, notice that rabbits occasionally run by and that the locals mutter "Gavagai" when the rabbits pass; we might be moved by this to translate their utterances as our own word "rabbit." Thinking of the translatability of one utterance with another thus achieves the same sort of theory-building effect that talk of shared meaning did, but without appeal to abstract objects like meanings. However, this also led to Quine's thesis of the "indeterminacy of translation." When we form such hypotheses based on observations of speakers' behavior, that evidence always underdetermines our hypothesis, and the evidence could be made to fit other translations, even if they start to sound a bit strange to us. Hence, "gavagai" might also be translated as "dinner" (if the locals eat rabbits) or "Lo, an undetached rabbit part!" We might narrow the plausible translations a bit with further observation, though not to the logical exclusion of all others. Direct queries of the local speakers might also winnow the set of plausible translations a bit, but this presumes a command of a great deal of abstract terminology that we share with those speakers, and this command would presumably rest upon a shared understanding of the simpler sorts of vocabulary with which we started. Hence, nothing that we can observe about those speakers will completely determine the correctness of one translation over all competitors and translation is always indeterminate. This is not to say that we should not prefer some translations over others, but our grounds for doing so are usually pragmatic concerns about simplicity and efficiency, We should also note that each speaker is in much the same position when it comes to understanding other speakers even in her mother tongue; we have only the observable behaviors of other speakers and familiarity with our own usage of such terms, and we must make ongoing assessments of other speakers in conversation in just these ways. Donald Davidson, Quine's student, would continue to develop these ideas even further in Quine's wake. Davidson emphasized that the interpretations we create of the expressions in our native language are no less radical than what Quine was suggesting of the field linguist's attempted translations of radically new expressions (see his 1984).

Quine's work inspired many, but also came under sharp attack. The behaviorism at the heart of his account has fallen out of favor with the majority of philosophers and cognitive scientists. Much of Noam Chomsky's (1959) critique of B.F Skinner may be said to apply to Quine's work. The emphasis on innateness and tacit knowledge in Chomsky's work has been subject to intense criticism as well, but this criticism has not pointed philosophers and linguists back towards the sort of strongly behaviorist empiricism on which Quine's account was founded. Still, most contemporary philosophers of language owe some debt to Quine for dismantling the dogmas of early analytical philosophy and opening new avenues of inquiry.

b. The Later Wittgenstein

Wittgenstein left Cambridge in the early 1920s and pursued projects outside academia for several years. He returned in 1929 and began doing very different sorts of work. It is a matter of great debate, even among Wittgenstein acolytes, how much affinity there is between these stages. Many philosophers of language will speak of "the later Wittgenstein" as though the earlier views were wholly different and incompatible, while others insist that there is strong continuity of themes and methods. Though his early work was widely misunderstood at the time, there can be little doubt that some important changes took place, and these are worth noting here.

In the posthumously published Philosophical Investigations (1953), Wittgenstein broke with some of the theoretical aspirations of analytical philosophy in the first half of the century. Where analytical philosophers of language had strived for elegant, parsimonious logical systems, the Investigations suggested that language was a diverse, mercurial collection of "language games"—goal-directed social activities for which words were just so many tools to get things done, rather than fixed and eternal components in a logical structure. Representation, denotation and picturing were some of the goals that we might have in playing a language game, but they were hardly the only ones. This turn in Wittgenstein's philosophy ushered in a new concern for the "pragmatic" dimensions of language usage. To speak of the pragmatic significance of an expression in this sense is to consider how grasping it might be manifested in actions, or the guiding of actions, and thus to turn our attention to usage rather than abstract notions of logical form common to earlier forms of analytical philosophy. (Speech act theorists will also distinguish between pragmatics and semantics in a slightly more restrictive sense, as we shall see in §4.2.) The view that "meaning is use" (1953, p.43) was often attributed to him, though interpretations of this view have varied widely. Wright (1980 and 2001) read this as a call to social conventionalism about meaning, McDowell (1984) explicitly rejected such a conclusion and Brandom (1994) took it as an entry point into an account of meaning that is both normative and pragmatic (that is, articulated in terms of obligations and entitlements to do things in certain ways according to shared practices). But it can be safely said that Wittgenstein rejected a picture of language as a detached, logical sort of picturing of the facts and inserted a concern for its pragmatic dimensions. One cannot look at the representational dimension of language alone and expect to understand what meaning is.

A second major development in the later Wittgenstein's work was his treatment of rules and rule-following. Meaning claims had a certain hold over our actions, but not the sort that something like a law of nature would. Claims about meaning reflect norms of usage and Wittgenstein argued that this made the very idea of a "private language" absurd. By this, he means it would not be possible to have a language whose meanings were accessible to only one person, the speaker of that language. Much of modern philosophy was built on Cartesian models that grounded public language on a foundation of private episodes, which implied that much (perhaps all) of our initial grasp of language would also be private. The problem here, said Wittgenstein, is that to follow a rule for the use of an expression, appeal to something private will not suffice. Thus, a language intelligible to only one person would be impossible because it would be impossible for that speaker to establish the meanings of its putative signs.

If a language were private, then the only way to establish meanings would be by some form of private ostension, for example, concentrating on one's experiences and privately saying, "I shall call this sensation 'pain'." But to establish a sign's meaning, something must impress upon the speaker a way of correctly using that sign in the future, or else the putative ostension is of no value. Assuming we began with such a private episode, what could be happening on subsequent uses of the term? We cannot simply say that it feels the same to us as it did before, or strikes us the same way, for those sorts of impressions are common even when we make errors and therefore cannot constitute correctness. One might say that one only has to remember how one used the sign in the past, but this still leaves us wondering. What is one remembering in that case? Until we say how a private episode could establish a pattern of correct usage, memory is beside the point. To alleviate this difficulty, Wittgenstein turned his attention to the realm of public phenomena, and suggested that those who make the same moves with the rules share a "lebensform" or "form of life," which most have taken to be one's culture or the sum total of the social practices in which one takes part. Kripke (1982) offered a notable interpretation of Wittgenstein's private language argument, though opinions vary on its fidelity to Wittgenstein's work. Subsequent generations of philosophers on both sides of the Atlantic would be profoundly influenced by this argument and struggle with its implications for decades to come.

4. Major Areas in the Contemporary Field

After the seminal works of Quine and Wittgenstein at mid-century, the majority of views expressed in the field may be broadly lumped into two groups: those emphasizing truth conditions for sentences in a theory of meaning and those emphasizing use. Truth-conditional theories continue the formal analysis of Frege, Carnap and Tarski, minus Positivism's more radical assumptions, while use theories and speech act theory take Wittgenstein's emphasis on the pragmatic to heart. A brief overview of major figures and issues in each of these follows.

a. Truth-Conditional Theories of Meaning

The majority of philosophers of language working in the analytical tradition share Frege's intuition that we know the meaning of a word when we know the role it plays in a sentence and we know the meaning of a sentence when we know the conditions under which it would be true. Davidson (1967) and Lewis (1972) argued for such an approach and stand as watersheds in its development. Truth-conditional theories generally begin with the assumption that something is a language or a linguistic expression if and only if its significant parts can represent the facts of the world. Sentences represent facts or states of affairs in the world, names refer to objects, and so forth. The central focus of a theory of meaning remains sentences though, since it is sentences that apparently constitute the most basic units of information. For instance, an utterance of the name "John Coltrane" does not seem to say anything until we point to someone and say, "This is John Coltrane" or assert "John Coltrane was born in North Carolina" and so on. This view of the sentence as the most basic units of meaning is compatible with compositionality, the view that sentences are composed of a finite stock of simpler elements that may be reused and recombined in novel ways, so long as we understand the meanings of those subsentential expressions as contributions to the meanings of sentences. We might understand names and other referring expressions as "picking out" their referents, to which the rest of a sentence attributes something, very roughly speaking. Truth-conditional theories of meaning have also been attractive to those who would prefer a naturalistic and reductionist semantics, appealing to nothing outside the natural world as an explainer of meaning. Strongly naturalistic accounts are also given by Evans (1983), Devitt (1981), and Devitt and Sterelny (1999).

Much attention in this area in the last twenty-five years has been directed at theories of reference, given the importance of explicating their contribution to truth-theoretical accounts. The view, often attributed to Frege, that the sense of proper names was a function of a set of descriptions led many philosophers seeking a truth-conditional account to include such descriptions in the truth conditions for sentences in which they occurred as a means of explaining their reference. However, a new wave of interest in more direct forms of reference began in the 1970s. The enthusiasm for this approach grew out of Kripke's Naming and Necessity (1980) and a series of articles by Hilary Putnam. (1973 and 1975) There, they attacked the notion that identity statements expressed synonymies, known a priori at the time of their introduction. If we (or whoever introduces the term) stipulate that Aristotle is the author of Nicomachean Ethics, tutor of Alexander, and so on, it would seem to be known a priori that this was true of the referent of that name. The referent is just that thing which satisfies all or most of the "cluster of descriptions" that express the sense of that name. But if we discovered that much or all of this was false of the person we had called "Aristotle," would this imply that Aristotle did not exist, or that someone else was Aristotle? Much the same could be said of natural kind terms: we took whales to be fish, but those big cetaceans have lungs and mammary glands, so are there no whales after all?

Instead, Putnam and Kripke suggested that proper names and natural kind terms (and descriptions like "the square root of 289") were rigid designators, or expressions that referred to the same objects or kinds in every possible world without that relation being mediated by some form of descriptive content. Other pieces of descriptive content are actually associated with those expressions—we do say that Aristotle wrote Nicomachean Ethics and that whales are mammals, and so on—but their reference is fixed at the time of their introduction and our use preserves that reference, not the descriptive content. The descriptions associated with a rigid designator ("the author of Nicomachean Ethics," and so on) are thus always revisable. This has been seen as a form of externalism in semantics, whereby the meanings of words are not entirely determined by psychological states of the speakers who use them, or as Putnam famously quipped, "meanings just ain't in the head" (1975, p. 227). Notable recent works in this field include Kitcher and Stanford (2000), Soames (2002) and Berger (2002). Several accounts have suggested that while rigid designation in itself has some plausibility, the reductionist elements of these theories leave us with an implausibly direct and unmediated account of reference that must be refined or replaced (Dummett (1974), MacBeth (1995) and Wolf (2006)).

b. Meaning and Use

Verificationist theories fell out of favor after Quine, but were reinvigorated by Michael Dummett's work on meaning and logic as well as his extensive exegetical work on Frege. (See his 1963, 1974, 1975 and 1976.) Dummett shared the Positivists' concern with the cognitive significance of a statement, which he interpreted as Frege's real concern in talking about sense in the first place. Many read Frege as a Platonist about meaning, but Dummett challenged the need for such ontological extensions and their plausibility as explainers of semantic facts in general. Dummett's position was less a product of a priori ontological stinginess than a continuation of Wittgensteinian themes. Dummett argued that a model of meaning is a model of our understanding when we know such meanings. We are sometimes able to express this understanding explicitly, but a model of meaning could not include such a criterion of explicitness on pain of an infinite regress. (Note Wittgenstein's Private Language Argument on this point.) Thus, the knowledge that generally constitutes understanding must be implicit knowledge and we can only ascribe such implicit knowledge when we have some sort of observable criteria by which to do so. These observable criteria will be matters of the use of sentences and expressions. (See Dummett 1973, pp. 216ff.)

While such a mix of usage and verification may be straightforward for sentences and conditions that occasionally obtain, it is quite another matter in cases in which they do not. We can grasp the meaning of a sentence whose truth conditions never actually obtain or can never (practically speaking) be verified, for example, "every even number is the sum of two primes." Knowing what it is for some condition to obtain and knowing that a particular case exemplifies this are separable conditions, so meaning cannot be the simple verification of placing someone in a certain condition and seeing what sentences they utter. Dummett expanded his account by the inclusion of conditions like providing correct inferential consequences of a sentence, correct novel use of a sentence and judgments about sufficient or probable evidence for the truth or falsity of a sentence. He maintains that some form of self-verifying presentations will support these demands and allow us to derive all the features of language use and meaning, though this remains a sticking point for many who are skeptical of such episodes and epistemic foundationalism in general.

Dummett's reading of Wittgenstein's emphasis on use has not been the only one, though. Following Sellars (1967), theorists like Harman (1982 and 1987), Block (1986 and 1987), and Brandom (1994) have all pursued an "inferential role" or "conceptual role" semantics that characterized a grasp of the meaning of sentences as a grasp of the inferences one would make to and from that sentence. Block and Harman have explicitly taken this as a basis of a functionalist account of mental content in psychology, as well. Brandom has not pursued such causal explanatory strategies, but instead has emphasized the rational dimension of linguistic competence and the importance of inference to such an account. We grasp the meaning of a sentence when we understand other sentences as relevant to it and infer to and from them in the course of giving and asking for reasons for the claims that we make. A substantial extension of this work, offering a robustly normative account of meaning in sharp contrast to the causal reductionism mentioned above, is offered in Lance and O'Leary-Hawthorne (1997).

c. Speech Act Theory and Pragmatics

Wittgenstein's later work sparked interest in the pragmatic dimensions of language use among some British philosophers working not long after his death, but a number grew exasperated with the more deflationary and "ordinary language" approaches of Wittgenstein's acolytes, who saw almost no role for theoretical accounts in describing language at all. Some opted instead to pursue what has come to be known as speech act theory, led initially by the work of John Austin. (See Grice (1975), Austin (1962) and Searle (1969).) These philosophers sought an account of language by which sentences were tools for doing things, including a taxonomy of uses to which pieces of the language could be put. While conventional meaning remained important, speech act theorists extended their focus to an examination of the different ways in which utterances and inscriptions of sentences might play a role in achieving various goals. For instance, the sentence

(16) It is sunny outside.

could be a report, an admonition not to take an umbrella, a lie (if it's not sunny), practicing English, a taunt and many other things depending on the scenario in which it is put to use.

To see clearly how speech act theorists might address these issues, we should take note of one of its central doctrines, the pragmatics/semantics distinction. We may state this generally by saying that semantic information pertains to linguistic expressions (such as words and sentences), while pragmatic information pertains to utterances and the facts surrounding them.  The study of pragmatics thus includes no attention to features like truth or the reference of words and expressions, but it does include attention to information about the context in which a speaker made the utterance and how those conditions allow the speaker to express one proposition rather than another. This strongly contextual element of pragmatics often leads to special attention to the goals that a speaker might achieve by uttering a sentence in a particular way in that context and why she might have done so. Thus, what a speaker means in saying something is often explained by an emphasis on the speaker's intentions: to reveal to the hearer that the speaker wants the hearer to respond in a certain way and thus to get the hearer to respond in this way. However, there may be cases in which these intentions have nothing to do with the meaning of the sentence. I might say, "It is raining outside," with the intention of getting you to take your umbrella, but that's not what the sentence means. Likewise, I might have said, "The Weather Channel is predicting rain this afternoon," with those intentions, but this does not entail that those two sentences mean the same thing.

Those intentions whose success is entirely a matter of getting a hearer's recognition of the actual intention itself are called illocutionary intentions; those intentions whose success is entirely a matter of getting the hearer to do something (above and beyond understanding the semantic content of what is said) are called perlocutionary intentions. Perlocutionary intentions must be achieved through illocutionary acts, for example, making you aware of my intentions to get you to realize something about the weather leads you to think of your umbrella and take it. Following Bach and Harnish (1979), speech act theorists typically characterize speech acts by four analytical subcomponents of speech acts: (1) utterance acts, that is, the very voicing or inscribing of words and sentences; (2) propositional acts, that is, referring to things and predicating properties and relations of them; (3) illocutionary acts, by which speakers interact with other speakers and the utterances constitute moves in that interaction, for example, promises and commands; and (4) perlocutionary acts, by which speakers bring about or achieve something in others by what they say, for example, convincing or persuading someone. Some theorists would also add "meaning intention" and "communicative intention" to this list to emphasize shared understanding of the conventional meanings attached with words and the intersubjectivity of speech acts. As these categories might imply, speech act theory has also incorporated far more consideration of conversational features of discourse and the social aspects of communications than other branches of the philosophy of language. For this reason, it offers promising points of connection between sophisticated semantic accounts and the empirical research of social scientists.

Grice (1975) also suggested that philosophy must consider the ways in which speakers go beyond what is strictly, overtly said by their utterances to consider what is contextually implicated by them. By "implicated," here, we are considering the ways in which the things a speaker says may invite another speaker to some further set of conclusions, but not in the strict logical sense of entailment or a purely formal matter of conventional meanings. Grice divided these implicatures into two large categories: conventional implicatures and conversational implicatures. Conventional implicatures are those assigned to utterances based on the conventional meanings of the words used, though not in the ways familiar from ordinary logical entailments. For instance:

(17) Michael is an Orioles fan, but he doesn't live in Baltimore.

(18) Michael is an Orioles fan, and he doesn't live in Baltimore.

(19) Michael's being an Orioles fan is unexpected, given that he doesn't live in Baltimore.

Here, (19) is implied by (17), but not by (18). This failure is not a matter of differences in what makes (17) and (18) true, but in the way in which conventions and conversational principles allow speakers to convey such information. Roughly, the word "but" is used by English speakers to emphasize contrast and surprise, as a speaker would in saying (17).

Conversational implicatures are assigned based on a series of maxims and assumptions by which speakers in conversation cooperate with one another, according to Grice. He suggests maxims of quantity (make your contribution informative but not excessively so), quality (make your contribution true), relation (be relevant), and manner (be perspicuous). To get a sense of how to apply these, consider one of Grice's (1975) examples:

(20) Smith doesn't seem to have a girlfriend these days.

(21) He has been paying a lot of visits to New York lately.

Imagine two people having a conversation, with A saying (20) and B saying (21). B implicates that Smith might have a girlfriend in New York, assuming that B is following the maxims mentioned above. If not, say, because B is saying something false or irrelevant, then speakers cannot cooperate and communication collapses. Grice contends that these conversational implicatures are calculable given the right sorts of contextual and background information, along with the linguistic meaning of what is said and the speakers' adherence to the cooperative maxims described earlier, and much of the literature on conversational implicature has attempted to make good on this notion. Many philosophers working on these aspects of pragmatics worry that these maxims will not suffice as an account of implicature however, and readers should consult Davis (1998) for the most current set of objections to classic Gricean accounts.

Attention to both forms of implicature has drawn philosophers' attention to matters of presupposition, as well. As the name would suggest, the discussion of this subject focuses on the sorts of information required as background for various sorts of logical and conversational features to obtain. The well-worn example, "Have you stopped robbing liquor stores?" presupposes that you have been robbing liquor stores. Implicatures of both forms thus involve various sorts of presupposition, for example the conventional implicature of "but" in (17) presupposes a proposition about the demographics of Orioles fans, and much recent work in pragmatics has been devoted to developing typologies of presupposition at work in conversation. The two most serious questions for theorists are (1) how presuppositions are introduced into or "triggered" in the sentences in which they play a role and (2) how they are "projected" or carried from the clauses and parts of sentences in which they appear up into the higher-level sentences. The origin of much of the work on this is Langendoen and Savin (1971), and a vast literature has developed in light of it in linguistics and formal semantics.

5. Future Directions and Emerging Debates

While linguistic analysis does not dominate thinking in analytical philosophy as it did for much of the twentieth century, it remains a vibrant field that continues to develop. As in the early days of analytical philosophy, there is great interest in parallels between the content of utterances and the attribution of content to mental states, but many cognitive scientists have moved away from the classic analytical assumption that thoughts had a symbolic or sentence-like content. Following the directions mapped out in Rumelhart and McClelland (1986) some cognitive scientists have embraced connectionism, a view that emphasizes the dynamic interaction between large sets of interconnected nodules (much like neurons in the brain), as a model for cognition. Thought would thus not be symbol processing, akin to an internal monologue, and the scope of traditional accounts of language and meaning would be greatly diminished. Readers may consult Tomberlin (1995) for an overview of the field and Churchland (1995) for one of its most ardent proponents. A defense of more traditional symbol-processing approaches has also developed, notably in the work of Fodor and Lepore (1999), complemented by even more radical challenges to symbol processing in the form of dynamic systems theory (see van Gelder 1995 and Rockwell 2005).

Much recent work in the philosophy of language has also been concerned with the context sensitivity of expressions and sentences. This has been driven in no small part by an increasing emphasis on context sensitivity in epistemology (DeRose 1998; Lewis 1996) and meta-ethics (Dancy 1993). Of course, much more emphasis had been put on context over the last fifty years by use and speech act theories. Recently, some have come out in favor of context insensitivity as the predominant mode of natural languages. Cappelen and Lepore (2005) do not argue that there are no context sensitive words or sentences, but rather for semantic minimalism, the view that there are relatively few and they are familiar categories like pronouns and indexicals. They combine this with new work on speech act content to mount a substantial challenge to a great many contemporary philosophers. This debate between minimalists and contextualists promises to be a lively one in the philosophy of language over the next few years.

6. References and Further Reading

  • (Works are listed first by their original dates of publication, with more recent and widely available editions included in some entries.)
  • Austin, J. L. (1962) How To Do Things With Words. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bach, K. and Harnish, R. (1979) Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Berger, Alan. (2002) Terms and Truth: Reference Direct and Anaphoric. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Block, N. (1986) "Advertisement For a Semantics for Psychology." In P. French, T. Uehling and H. Wettstein (Eds.). Midwest Studies in Philosophy, vol. 10, pp. 615-678. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Block, N. (1987) "Functional Role and Truth Conditions," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 61, 157-181.
  • Brandom, R. (1994) Making It Explicit. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Cappelen, H. and Lepore, E. (2005) Insensitive Semantics. Oxford: Basil Blackwell Pub.
  • Carnap, R. (1928) The Logical Structure of the World (Die Logische Aufbau der Welt). George, E. (trans.) New York: Open Court Classics, 1999.
  • Chomsky, N. (1959) "A Review of B. F. Skinner's Verbal Behavior." In Language, 35(1), 26-58.
  • Churchland, P. (1995) Engine of Reason, Seat of the Soul: A Philosophical Journey Into the Brain. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Dancy, J. (1993) Moral Reasons. Oxford: Basil Blackwell Pub.
  • Davidson, D. (1967) "Truth and Meaning." In Davidson (1984), pp. 17-36.
  • Davidson, D. (1984) Inquiries Into Truth and Interpretation. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Davis, W. (1998) Implicature: Intention, Convention and Principle in the Failure of Gricean Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • DeRose K. (1995) "Solving the Skeptical Problem." The Philosophical Review 104(1), 1-7, 17-52.
  • Devitt, Michael. (1981) Designation. New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Devitt, M. and Sterelny, K. (1999) Language and Reality. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Dummett, M. (1963) "Realism." In Dummett (1978), pp. 145-165.
  • Dummett, M. (1973) "The Philosophical Basis of Intuitionistic Logic." In Dummett (1978), pp. 215-247.
  • Dummett, M. (1974) "The Social Character of Meaning." In Dummett (1978), pp. 420-430.
  • Dummett, M. (1975) "Frege's Distinction Between Sense and Reference." In Dummett (1978), pp. 116-144.
  • Dummett, M. (1976) "What Is a Theory of Meaning? (II)" In Truth and Meaning: Essays in Semantics. G. Evans and J. McDowell. (Eds.) Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Dummett, M. (1978) Truth and Other Enigmas. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Evans, G. (1983) The Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Field, H. (1972) "Tarski's Theory of Truth." Journal of Philosophy 69, 347-75.
  • Field, H. (1977) "Logic, Meaning and Conceptual Role" Journal of Philosophy 74, 379-408.
  • Fodor, J and E. Lepore. (1999) "All at Sea in Semantic Space: Churchland on Meaning Similarity." Journal of Philosophy 96, 381-403.
  • Frege, G. (1892) "On Sense and Reference." In The Frege Reader. Beaney, M. (Ed.) London: Penguin Press, 1997.
  • Frege, G. (1884) The Foundations of Arithmetic: A Logico-Mathematical Enquiry into the Concept of Number. J. Austin (Trans.) Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1980.
  • Grice, P. (1975) "Logic and Conversation." In Studies in the Way of Words, pp. 22-40. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1989.
  • Harman, G. (1982) "Conceptual Role Semantics." Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 23, 242-56.
  • Harman, G. (1987) "(Non-solipsistic) Conceptual Role Semantics." In New Directions in Semantics. E. Lepore. (Ed.) London: Academic Press.
  • Hempel, C. (1950) "Problems and Changes in the Empiricist Criterion of Meaning." Revenue Internationale de Philosophie 11, 41-63.
  • Kitcher, P. and M. Stanford. (2000) "Refining the Causal Theory of Reference for Natural Kind Terms." Philosophical Studies 97, 99-129.
  • Kripke, S. (1972) Naming and Necessity, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Kripke, S. (1982) Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Lance, M. and O'Leary-Hawthorne, J. (1997) The Grammar of Meaning. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Langendoen, D.T. and Savin, H.B. (1971) "The Projection Problem for Presuppositions." In C.J. Fillmore and D.T. Langendoen (Eds.) Studies in Linguistic Semantics. New York: Holt, Reinhart and Winston.
  • Lewis, D. (1972) "General Semantics." In G. Harman and D. Davidson (Eds.) Semantics of Natural Language. Dordrecht: D. Reidel Pub.
  • Lewis, D. (1996) "Elusive Knowledge." Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74(4), 549-67.
  • Locke, J. (1690) An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. P. Nidditch. (Ed.) Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975.
  • MacBeth, D. (1995) "Names, Natural Kinds and Rigid Designation." Philosophical Studies 79, 259-281.
  • McDowell, J. (1984) "Wittgenstein on Following a Rule." Synthese 58(3), 325-364.
  • Meinong, A. (1904) "Über Gegenstandstheorie." In A. Meinong (ed.), Untersuchungen zur Gegenstandstheorie und Psychologie, Leipzig: Barth.
  • Mill, J.S. (1843) System of Logic: Ratiocinative and Inductive. Stockton, CA: University Press of the Pacific, 2002.
  • Neurath, O. (1933) "Protocol Sentences." G. Shick. (Trans.) In A. Ayer (Ed.) Logical Positivism, pp. 199-208. New York: The Free Press, 1959.
  • Putnam, H. (1973) "Meaning and Reference." The Journal of Philosophy 70, 699-711.
  • Putnam, H. (1975) "The Meaning of Meaning." In Mind, Language and Reality, pp. 215-271. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Rockwell, T. (2005) "Attractor Spaces as Modules: A Semi-Eliminative Reduction of Symbolic AI to Dynamic Systems Theory." Minds and Machines 15(1), 23-95.
  • Rumelhart, D. and McClelland, J. and the PDP Research Group. (2006) Parallel Distributed Processing: Explorations in the Microstructure of Cognition, Vol. 2: Psychological and Biological Models. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Russell, B. (1905) "On Denoting." Mind 14, 479-493.
  • Russell, B. (1919) "Descriptions." In Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy pp. 167-180. London: George Allen and Unqin Ltd.
  • Quine, W.V.O. (1953) "Two Dogmas of Empiricism." In From a Logical Point of View, pp. 20-46. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Quine, W.V.O. (1960) Word and Object. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Quine, W.V.O. (1969) "Ontological Relativity." In Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, pp 26-68. New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Schlick, M. (1933) "Positivism and Realism." D. Rynin. (Trans.). In A. Ayer (Ed.) Logical Positivism, pp. 82-107. New York: The Free Press, 1959.
  • Searle, J. (1969) Speech Acts: An Essay in the Philosophy of Language. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sellars, W. (1967) Science and Metaphysics. Atascasdero, CA: Ridgeview Press.
  • Soames, S. (2002) Beyond Rigidity: The Unfinished Semantic Agenda of Naming and Necessity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Tarski, A. (1933) "The concept of truth in the languages of the deductive sciences." In A. Tarski. Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics, papers from 1923 to 1938, pp. 152-278. Corcoran, J. (Ed.). Indianapolis : Hackett Publishing Company, 1983.
  • Tarski, A. (1944) "The Semantic Conception of Truth and the Foundations of Semantics." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 4, 341-375
  • Tomberlin, J. (Ed.) (1995) Philosophical Perspectives 9: AI, Connectionism and Philosophical Psychology. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Press.
  • Van Gelder, T. (1995) "What Might Cognition Be If Not Computation?" Journal of Philosophy 92, 345-381.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (1922) Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. C. Ogden. (Trans.) New York: Dover Pub., 1999.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (1953) Philosophical Investigations: The German Text, With a Revised English Translation. Anscombe, G. and Anscombe, E. (Trans.). Oxford: Basil Blackwell Pub., 2002.
  • Wolf, M. (2006) "Rigid Designation and Anaphoric Theories of Reference." Philosophical Studies 130(2), 351-375.
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  • Wright, C. (2001). Rails to Infinity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Author Information

Michael P. Wolf
Washington and Jefferson College
U. S. A.

Conceptual Role Semantics

In the philosophy of language, conceptual role semantics (hereafter CRS) is a theory of what constitutes the meanings possessed by expressions of natural languages, or the propositions expressed by their utterance. In the philosophy of mind, it is a theory of what constitutes the contents of psychological attitudes, such as beliefs or desires.

CRS comes in a variety of forms, not always clearly distinguished by commentators. Such versions are known variously as functional/causal/computational role semantics, and more broadly as use-theories of meaning. Nevertheless, all are united in seeking the meaning or content of an item, not in what it is made of, nor in what accompanies or is associated with it, but in what is done with it, the use it is put to. Roughly, according to CRS, the meaning or propositional content of an expression or attitude is determined by the role it plays in a person’s language or in her cognition.

Currently, many view CRS as the main rival to theories that take notions such as truth or reference as central (for example, Davidson 2001), although the relationship between the two is not straightforward. The following outlines the main varieties of CRS, provides a cursory survey of its history, introduces the central arguments offered in its favor, and provisionally assesses how the variants fair against a number of prominent criticisms.

Table of Contents

  1. Preparing the Ground
    1. A Theory of Linguistic Meaning
    2. A Theory of Content
    3. Normativism and Naturalism
    4. Perception and Action
    5. Language and Mind
    6. Provisional Summary
  2. A Very Brief History
  3. Arguments for CRS
    1. Attributions of Meaning and Understanding
    2. The No Intrinsic Meaning Thesis
    3. The Insufficiency of Causation
    4. The Frege-problem
    5. Methodological Solipsism
  4. Problems for CRS
    1. Holism, Compositionality and Analyticity
    2. Proper Names
    3. Externalism
    4. Truth, Reference and Intentionality
    5. Indeterminacy
    6. Defective Expressions and Conservatism
    7. Circularity
  5. Prospects and Applications
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Preparing the Ground

a. A Theory of Linguistic Meaning

CRS may be first introduced as a theory of meaning. The theory of meaning must be distinguished from a meaning-theory. The former is a philosophical project that seeks to explain what meaning is, or what the meaning possessed by expressions in a natural language consists in. The latter, in contrast, is an empirical project. More specifically, it is a specification of the meaning of each expression in a language. Since a natural language such as English contains a potential infinity of expressions, these specifications must be derived from a finite body of axioms concerning sentence constituents and their modes of combination. CRS is a theory of meaning rather than a meaning-theory, although as such it can and should inform the construction of meaning-theories.

One must also distinguish the meaning of an expression from what is said (the proposition expressed) by its utterance. For example, what is said by the use of ‘I am tired now’ varies according to who employs the expression and when, whereas the meaning remains constant. Arguably, this overt context-dependency in the case of sentences containing indexicals is quite general (see Travis 2000). Hence, the invariant meaning possessed by a sentence is distinct from the truth-evaluable propositional content expressed by its use on a particular occasion, although the former (in combination with contextual factors) determines the latter.

CRS can be profitably viewed as a refinement of the claim that the meaning of an expression is its use (Wittgenstein 1967: §43; cf. Alston 2000; see Wittgenstein, Ludwig). While many philosophers might accept as platitudinous that, in some sense, an expression means what it does because of how it is employed, what is here distinctive is the claim that its having a meaning is its having a use. So stated, however, the view suffers from a number of objections. Many things have a ‘use’ (for example, hammers) but no meaning. More seriously, there are linguistic expressions with a use but no meaning, such as ‘um’ or ‘abracadabra’. Likewise, there can be differences in use without differences in meaning. For example, where and by whom a word is used can vary while meaning remains constant (see Glock 1996; Lycan 2000: 94ff; Rundle 2001: 100-1; Whiting 2007b).

One response to such criticisms is to identify more narrowly the specific kind of use that is supposed to be constitutive of meaning. According to CRS, it is use in inference. Roughly, it claims that to understand an expression is to be prepared to make certain inferential transitions. Accordingly, the meaning of the expression is its inferential role. If one were to enumerate all the transitions an expression is involved in, one would thereby give its meaning. So, to take a simplified example, to grasp the meaning of ‘brother’ is to be prepared to make linguistic moves of the following kind:

"x is a male sibling" → "x is a brother"

"x is a brother" → "x has parents"

Note that it is somewhat misleading to call the above ‘inferential’ transitions, since properly-speaking inferential relations hold between propositions not sentences. Nevertheless, the basic idea remains the same once qualified. One might say that the invariant meaning an expression possesses is its inferential potential, that is, its usability by speakers to make certain inferential transitions.

Note also that it is sentences that in the first instance can properly be said to have inferential significance, since ordinarily it is only by uttering a sentence that one make a claim from which other claims might be said to follow. Hence, for CRS, it is sentences that are the primary bearers of meaning. Nonetheless, a proponent of CRS can still speak of the meaning of a word as its stable contribution to the inferential potential of sentences or, more abstractly, as the set of inferential roles of sentences in which it occurs.

b. A Theory of Content

CRS extends straightforwardly to a theory of the propositional content expressed by the use of an expression. According to it, to know what is said by an utterance is to know, given the context, what the grounds for making the utterance are, and which further utterances are thereby in order. For an utterance to express such content just is for s