Category Archives: Metaphysics

Truthmaker Theory

Truthmaker theory is the branch of metaphysics that explores the relationships between what is true and what exists. Discussions of truthmakers and truthmaking typically start with the idea that truth depends on being, and not vice versa. For example, if the sentence ‘Kangaroos live in Australia’ is true, then there are kangaroos living in Australia. And if there are kangaroos living in Australia, then the sentence ‘Kangaroos live in Australia’ is true. But we can ask whether the sentence is true because of the way the world is, or whether the world is the way it is because the sentence is true. Truthmaker theorists make the former claim that the sentence is true because of what exists in the world; it is not the case that the world is the way it is because of which sentences are true. Truthmaker theorists use this fundamental idea as a starting point for clarifying the nature of truth and its relationship to ontology, and to advance various views in metaphysics concerning the nature of the past and future, counterfactual conditionals, modality, and many others. Because truthmaker theorists end up with differing views concerning all these matters, what ultimately unites them is not any single thesis but rather a commitment to thinking that the idea of truthmaking is a useful one for pursuing metaphysical inquiry. Others might conceive of ‘truthmaker theory’ more strictly (such as by requiring a commitment to all truths having truthmakers, or all truthmakers being of a particular ontological variety), though defining the enterprise in this way will inevitably fail to capture all those earnestly pursuing investigation into truthmaking.

Philosophical discussion of truthmakers falls into two broad categories. First, there are ‘internal’ debates about the nature of truthmaker theory itself. For instance, there are open questions as to which truths have truthmakers: do all truths have truthmakers, or just some proper subset of truths (such as the positive truths or synthetic truths)? There are questions as to the nature of the truthmaking relation: is it a necessary relation or a contingent one? Is it a kind of supervenience, dependence, or something else? And it is an open question as to what sorts of objects serve as truthmakers: perhaps there are states of affairs, tropes, or counterparts that serve as truthmakers, or perhaps none of these. There is also frequent debate as to whether truthmaker theory constitutes a theory of truth (similar to, in particular, the correspondence theory of truth), or whether it is an entirely separate philosophical enterprise, one concerned more with metaphysics rather than semantics.

There are also ‘external’ truthmaking discussions that apply basic ideas about truthmaking to longstanding metaphysical topics. The hope is that truthmaker theory can bring new insights and argumentative resources to bear on traditional metaphysical inquiries. For example, truthmaker theorists investigate whether presentism—the view that only the present exists—can satisfy the obligations of truthmaker theory. Truthmaker theory has also been wielded against metaphysical views such as behaviorism and phenomenalism, and it has made contributions to the metaphysics of modality.

Table of Contents

  1. History of Truthmaker Theory
  2. The Truthmaking Relation
  3. Maximalism and Non-Maximalism
  4. Kinds of Truthmakers
  5. Truthmaking Principles
  6. Truthmaking and Truth
  7. Truthmaking and the Past
  8. Truthmaking and Modality
  9. Objections to Truthmaker Theory
  10. References and Further Reading

1. History of Truthmaker Theory

Perhaps the first occurrence of a basic truthmaking idea is found in Aristotle’s Categories. There Aristotle points out that if a certain man exists, then a statement that that man exists is true, and vice versa. But it seems that there is a difference in priority between these two states of affairs. The statement is true because the man exists; it is not the case that the man exists because the statement is true. Aristotle is, in effect, raising a ‘Euthyphro’ question, drawing on Plato’s famous dialogue. Is the statement true because of the way the world is, or is the world the way it is because of which statements are true? Aristotle chose the former answer, and set the stage for discussions of truthmakers far down the road.

The idea of a truthmaker did not play a significant role in philosophy until the rise of logical atomism in the work of Bertrand Russell and Ludwig Wittgenstein. In the Philosophy of Logical Atomism, Russell takes it to be a truism that there are facts, and says that facts are the sort of thing that make propositions true or false. The project of logical atomism is then to determine what sorts of facts are ontologically required in order to make true all the different kinds of propositions. The most basic kind of fact for Russell is the atomic fact, which consists of no more than the possession of a quality by a particular object (or of the holding of a relation between multiple objects). Sentences like ‘X is green’ and ‘X is heavier than Y’, if true, are made true by atomic facts. More complex sentences like ‘X is green and is heavier than Y’ do not call for more complex, ‘molecular’ facts. Instead, the same atomic facts from before can explain the truth of conjunctive sentences. Particularly worrisome are negative truths, such as ‘X is not red’. Russell believed that there need to be negative facts to account for negative truths. In advocating for the existence of negative facts, Russell claims to have ‘nearly produced a riot’ when he suggested the idea at a seminar at Harvard (1985: 74). The idea that reality contains entities that are fundamentally negative in nature has long struck many philosophers as puzzling and metaphysically unacceptable, and there has been continuing controversy over what, if anything, makes negative truths true.

The next major advance in truthmaker theory came from the work of the Australian philosopher David Armstrong. Armstrong—who credits fellow philosopher Charlie Martin with inspiring him on the topic—has long advocated the use of truthmakers in metaphysics. Armstrong cites two paradigm examples of how truthmakers can be put to work in philosophy. First, there is the case of behaviorism, as defended by Gilbert Ryle (1949). Ryle’s philosophy of mind relies heavily on dispositions; Ryle thought that claims involving mental terms could be analyzed into subjunctive conditionals involving dispositions. What it is for Ryle to believe that he is a philosopher is that if he were to be asked what his profession was, he would reply ‘philosopher’. While this counterfactual may be true, the truthmaker theorist asks: but what is it that makes it true? The behaviorist faces a challenge of either accepting this counterfactual as a brute truth, a truth with no further explanation, or admitting that it is made true by some sort of mental state, thus abandoning the supposed ontological economy of behaviorism.

Similarly, Armstrong argues that the phenomenalism of philosophers such as Berkeley and Mill faces a parallel difficulty. According to phenomenalism, all that exists are sensory impressions. But might it not be true that there is a rock on the dark side of the moon that no one has ever observed? The phenomenalist accounts for this idea by claiming that if you were to go to that part of the moon, you would have a rock-like sensory impression. But again: what makes that counterfactual true? The anti-phenomenalist will say that the counterfactual is true because it is made true (at least in part) by the rock itself. The phenomenalist, limited by an ontology of actual sense impressions, is hard-pressed to find a plausible answer to the truthmaker theorist’s question.

In the wake of Armstrong’s (and others’) writings, truthmaker theory became a lively corner of contemporary metaphysics.

2. The Truthmaking Relation

A key concern of truthmaker theory is giving an account of the truthmaking relation. When some object X is a truthmaker for some truth Y, what is the nature of the relationship that X and Y stand in?

One universally agreed upon fact about the truthmaking relation is that it is not a one-one relation. That is, in principle an object can be a truthmaker for multiple truths, and any given truth can have multiple truthmakers. For example, Socrates is frequently thought to be a truthmaker not only for ‘Socrates exists’, but also for ‘Socrates is human’ and ‘There are humans’. For it is impossible that Socrates—who is essentially human—could exist and yet any of those sentences be false (at least given some familiar assumptions about essences). Similarly, ‘There are humans’ is made true by many things—anything that is essentially human, in fact. Hence, it can be misleading to ask what the truthmaker for some truth is, since it is not necessary that truths have only one, unique truthmaker.

So what exactly is the nature of the relation? To ask this question is to probe what sort of analysis, if any, can be given of the truthmaking relation. Many truthmaker theorists have argued that the truthmaking relation, at the least, requires metaphysical necessitation. Some object X necessitates the truth of Y if and only if it is metaphysically impossible for X to exist, and yet Y not be true. In the language of possible worlds, X necessitates Y if and only if every possible world in which X exists is a world in which Y is true. Necessitation is thought to be a necessary component of the truthmaking relation because it shows that the truthmaker’s existence is a sufficient condition on the truth in question. If X’s existence were not enough to guarantee Y’s truth, then X would not yet adequately explain or account for the truth of Y. Something else, in addition to X, would be needed to properly account for Y’s truth.

Not all theorists have agreed that necessitation is necessary for truthmaking. Hugh Mellor (2003), for instance, at one point argued that truthmakers need not necessitate the truths that they make true. Mellor relied on the controversial case of general truths, such as ‘All gold spheres are less than a mile in diameter’. Suppose there are three such spheres, A, B, and C. Then there are three states of affairs (Mellor calls them ‘facta’): A’s being less than a mile in diameter, B’s being less than a mile in diameter, and C’s being less than a mile in diameter. For Mellor, the truthmaker for the general truth is no more than the sum of the three states of affairs. But these three states of affairs do not necessitate the truth of ‘All gold spheres are less than a mile in diameter’, since it is possible that that very sum could exist, and yet the sentence be false. That is a case where, for example, A, B, and C all exist with diameters less than a mile, but a fourth gold sphere D exists whose diameter is greater than a mile. Mellor reasons that the sum of the three states of affairs is the truthmaker for ‘All gold spheres are less than a mile in diameter’, and thus concludes that truthmaking does not require necessitation. (Furthermore, on his view, the truthmaking relation is contingent in the sense that whether X is a truthmaker for Y can vary from world to world. Those who accept necessitation would reject this consequence.) Other theorists argue that truthmaking does require necessitation, and so the sum is not a truthmaker for the sentence; something else (such as one of the totality states of affairs discussed below) is needed to provide a truthmaker, or perhaps it has no truthmaker at all (according to advocates of the supervenience accounts discussed below).

It is more common for philosophers to challenge the sufficiency of the necessitation condition, rather than its necessity. The concern that necessitation is not enough derives in large part from the fact that all objects necessitate the truth of all necessary truths. This is the problem of trivial truthmakers for necessary truths. For example, Socrates necessitates ‘2 + 2 = 4’, for it is metaphysically impossible for Socrates to exist and yet ‘2 + 2 = 4’ be false. Similarly, if God exists, and exists necessarily, then a torn, dog-eared copy of Lolita rotting away in some landfill necessitates the truth of ‘God exists’. If it is impossible for that sentence to be false, then it is impossible for that sentence to be false should that rotting copy of Lolita exist. But—according to this line of thought—Socrates is not a truthmaker for ‘2 + 2 = 4’, and the copy of Lolita is not a truthmaker for ‘God exists’. Truthmaking requires more than just necessitation.

Theories divide as to what exactly else is required of the truthmaking relation. Trenton Merricks (2007) has argued that truthmaking requires ‘aboutness’, in that X is a truthmaker for Y only if Y is about X. Mathematical claims are not about Socrates, and so Socrates cannot make them true. ‘God exists’ is about God, so only God is a candidate truthmaker for it. Those who accept Merricks’s proposal thereby avoid the problem of trivial truthmakers for necessary truths.

E. J. Lowe (2007) conceives of truthmaking as depending upon the essences of propositions. X is a truthmaker for Y only if it is part of the essence of Y that it be true should an object like X exist. This amendment solves the problem of trivial truthmakers because it is no part of the essence of the proposition expressed by ‘God exists’ that it be true should the copy of Lolita exist. The essence of the proposition that God exists has nothing to do with the rotting copy of Lolita, just as the proposition that two and two are four has nothing to do with Socrates. Lowe criticizes his own view on the grounds that it implies that propositions can be related to things that do not exist. For example, Batman could have been a truthmaker for ‘There are humans’, since the nature of the proposition that there are humans is such that it is true if things like Batman existed. So according to Lowe’s account, the proposition’s essence appears to stand in a relation to a non-existent entity, which is concerning for anyone who takes relations to entail the existence of their relata.

Regardless of how the problem of trivial truthmakers is solved, theorists seem to be agreed that the truthmaking relation, however ultimately analyzed, needs to be treated as a hyperintensional relation. That is, as a matter of necessity, a particular object could exist and a particular claim could be true in all the same possible worlds without that object being a truthmaker for the claim. Hence, truthmaking is a relation that is more discriminating than modal relations such as necessitation. Truthmaking is thus more like a dependence relation, or a grounding relation, than relations like necessitation or supervenience. Sometimes it is said that truthmaking is an ‘in virtue of’ relation: X is a truthmaker for Y because Y is true ‘in virtue’ of the existence of X (for example, Rodriguez-Pereyra 2006c). X is somehow ontologically responsible for the truth of Y, and no merely intensional relation is thought to capture this deeper connection between a truth and its truthmaker.

Some theorists accept that truthmaking is a kind of ‘in virtue of’ relation, but deny that it can be further analyzed. This is the view of, for example, Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra (2006c), who holds that the truthmaking relation is a primitive notion that resists analysis.

In addition to the project of analyzing the components of the truthmaking relation (or admitting that such an analysis cannot be offered), there is also a question of what the structural and logical features of the relation are. One issue concerns the nature of the kinds of relata that the relation takes. The relation is typically understood to hold between a truth and a truthmaker. In this sense it is usually ‘cross-categorial’ in that it obtains between very different kinds of things, items from different categories. The truth that Socrates exists is made true by Socrates: here we have a case where the truthmaking relation obtains between a person and a truthbearer.

For many truthmaker theorists, there is no restriction on the kind of object that can be a truthmaker. To be a truthmaker, something just needs to appropriately account for the truth of some truthbearer. On this view, truthmakers are just whatever sorts of things are ontologically available. Other views impose restrictions. For example, one might argue that only facts or state of affairs are properly thought of as truthmakers. On this view, Socrates could not be a truthmaker for ‘Socrates exists’ because Socrates himself is not a fact or state of affairs. (At best he is a sort of abstraction from various states of affairs or facts.) There must be some other entity, such as the fact that Socrates exists, or a state of affairs composed by Socrates and an existence property, that makes the sentence true. Other views would find this perspective ontologically inflating: we do not need, in addition to Socrates, some further state of affairs that requires a property of existence in order to give an ontological account of the truth of ‘Socrates exists’. Finally, some have thought that only certain entities deserve to be thought of as truthmakers, such as fundamental entities (for example, Cameron 2008). On this view, X is a truthmaker for Y only if X is a fundamental entity.

As for the other side of the truthmaking relation, theorists disagree as to what sorts of objects are the bearers of truth. More restrictive views maintain that there is only one sort of truthbearer, or that there is only one primary kind of truthbearer, compared to which all other truthbearers are derivative. For example, a common view is that some sentence or belief bears truth only in virtue of expressing a true proposition, where propositions are the primary bearers of truth and falsity. More liberal views are happy to concede that there are a variety of truthbearers, and that they can all stand in the truthmaking relation. It is not clear that substantive questions about truthmaker theory turn on one’s background views about truthbearers, but it is wise to be sensitive to the ways in which truthmaking considerations might be affected by issues concerning truthbearers. For example, one could argue that while Socrates is a sufficient truthmaker for the proposition that Socrates exists (for it is impossible for Socrates to exist and yet that proposition be false), he is not a sufficient truthmaker for the sentence ‘Socrates exists’ because it is possible for Socrates to exist and yet the sentence be false, should the sentence have turned out to have a different meaning. For example, it is possible that ‘Socrates exists’ could have meant something else—such as that Socrates is Persian—and so it is possible that Socrates could have existed and that sentence be false. On this reading, then, one might take the truthmaker for the (uninterpreted) sentence to be more involved than the truthmaker for the proposition that sentence contingently expresses. What makes ‘Socrates exists’ true is Socrates plus whatever it is that makes it true that ‘Socrates exists’ means that Socrates exists.

Finally, consider some of the logical features of the truthmaking relation. In particular, there is the issue of how truthmaking stands with respect to reflexivity, symmetry, and transitivity. A relation is reflexive when every object that stands in the relation stands in the relation to itself. This would mean that every truth is its own truthmaker. The cross-categorial nature of truthmaking prohibits this possibility. Because not all truthmakers are truthbearers, the truthmaking relation is not reflexive.

Many theorists argue that truthmaking is irreflexive, in that there is no instance of something standing in the truthmaking relation to itself. (Hence, irreflexivity is stronger than the view that truthmaking is non-reflexive, which means that not every truth is its own truthmaker.) The general thought here is that truthmaking is a kind of dependence relation, and nothing can depend upon itself. But there are plausible counterexamples to irreflexivity. For example, the proposition that there are propositions appears to be a case of self-truthmaking. Because that proposition exists, it is true. One might respond by saying that the relation in this case actually holds between the existence of the proposition and the truth of the proposition, and so not between one and the same thing. This response, however, requires a substantial rethinking of the nature of the truthmaking relation (such that it no longer holds between truthmakers and truthbearers), and the apparent reification of properties like truth and existence.

Similar remarks apply to symmetry. A symmetric relation is one where if X bears it to Y, Y bears it to X. The cross-categorial nature of truthmaking again shows that the truthmaking relation is not in general symmetric. Not all truthmakers are truthbearers. But because some truthbearers can be truthmakers, the possibility for symmetry arises, in which case the relation is just non-symmetric. (Again, some will resist by suggesting that truthmaking, as a kind of dependence, must be anti-symmetric: if X depends on Y, Y does not depend on X.) In fact, any case of reflexive truthmaking will provide a case of symmetric truthmaking.

Finally consider transitivity: if X stands in R to Y, and Y stands in R to Z, then X stands in R to Z. Transitivity fails for obvious reasons. Socrates is a truthmaker for the proposition that Socrates exists, and the proposition that Socrates exists is a truthmaker for the proposition that there are propositions. But Socrates is no truthmaker for the proposition that there are propositions. Truthmaking is not transitive in general, but there could be individual instances of it (drawing on the same cases of reflexivity and symmetry).

3. Maximalism and Non-Maximalism

Another central question any truthmaker theorist must address concerns which truths have truthmakers. Perhaps all truths have truthmakers, or perhaps just some proper subset of the truths have truthmakers. Truthmaker maximalism is the thesis that all truths have truthmakers. Truthmaker non-maximalism maintains that there are truthmaker gaps: truths that have no truthmaker.

There have not been many arguments for maximalism. Its defenders frequently claim that the view is on its own quite intuitive and plausible. Resisting maximalism, according to such advocates, threatens to court the view that truths can ‘float free’ of reality. A truth without a truthmaker, on this view, is a brute truth, a truth for which there can be no explanation. Such truths, if they exist, are thought by maximalists to be metaphysically mysterious. Others have argued for maximalism by conceiving of having a truthmaker as being somehow essential to being true. If what it is to be true is to have a truthmaker, then something cannot be true without having a truthmaker. (The relationship between truth and truthmaking is further discussed in section 5.)

One motivation for non-maximalism is the existence of plausible counterexamples to the thesis that all truths have truthmakers. Consider negative existential truths, such as ‘There are no merlions’. On the face of it, the sentence is true not because some kind of thing exists; it is true because nothing of a different kind exists. A truthmaker for the negative existential would have to be some sort of entity whose existence excluded the existence of merlions, and explained their non-existence. But there is nothing in the world among the ‘positive’ entities that can guarantee that there are no merlions. Take, for example, the set of all the actually existing animals. Taken together, their existence does not guarantee the absence of merlions. For that set of animals could exist and yet it still be true that there are, in addition, merlions. It is only if we somehow combine the existence of those animals together with the fact that those animals are all the animals that we can find a suitable truthmaker for the negative existential.

Armstrong introduced a ‘totaling’ relation in response to these difficulties. For example, there is a state of affairs composed of the sum of all the animals standing in the totaling relation to the property of being an animal. This state of affairs fixes which animals exist, and so excludes the existence of any merlions. Armstrong generalizes this approach when he argues for the existence of what he calls the ‘totality state of affairs’. This is a second-order state of affairs that is composed of the sum of all the first-order state of affairs standing in the totaling relation to the property of being a first-order state of affairs. The existence of this second-order state of affairs thereby guarantees that the first-order states of affairs that partially compose it are all the first-order states of affairs there are. This single totality state of affairs can be a truthmaker for all negative existentials (and every other truth besides).

Like Russell’s negative facts, totality states of affairs are thought by many to be entities that are not fully ‘positive’. Their existence seems to concern what is not in addition to what is, and this is thought to be metaphysically suspicious. One way of putting the worry is that they are entities whose existence bears on the existence of things that are fully distinct from them. Ordinarily, one object’s existence does not bear on the existence of other objects that are separate from it. The existence of the Statue of Liberty neither entails nor excludes the existence of the Eiffel Tower. Neither does their existence exclude the existence of other potential landmarks that happen not to exist (such as a replica of the Statue of Liberty in Victoria Harbour). Totality states of affairs are different. The totality of animals excludes the existence of merlions, though merlions are entirely distinct from totalities of animals. For this reason, some philosophers have sought to develop non-maximalist approaches to truthmaker theory.

One prominent way of defending non-maximalism is to defend alternate principles that attempt to capture the dependence of truth upon being, but without admitting that all truths have truthmakers. One such principle is the thesis that truth supervenes on being, and it has been defended in both strong and weak versions. The strong version, defended by John Bigelow (1988), is the principle that if some proposition P is true at some world W1 but not world W2, then there must exist some entity at W1 that does not exist at W2, or some entity that exists at W2 but not W1. This principle captures the idea that what is true cannot vary from possible world to possible world unless there is some corresponding difference in the ontology of those worlds. Truth thus depends on being, although some truths escape having truthmakers. To see why, suppose that ‘There are merlions’ is false at W1 but true at W2. The principle implies that something must exist in one of these worlds but not the other. In this case, there is a merlion that exists at W2 but does not exist at W1. Although the negative existential ‘There are no merlions’ is true at W1, it has no truthmaker in that world. Nevertheless, its truth depends on the ontology of the world in the sense that, had it been false, there would have been something in the world’s ontology (namely, a merlion) that it does not currently have.

David Lewis (2001) has defended a weaker supervenience principle. For Lewis, if some proposition P is true at some world W1 but not world W2, then either there must exist some entity at only one of the worlds, or some group of things must stand in some fundamental relation at one of the worlds but not the other. Like the strong supervenience principle, this weaker principle allows one to accept negative existentials as truthmaker gaps, but also allows one to treat contingent predications as truthmaker gaps. For example, suppose that while W1 and W2 contain all the same objects, they differ with respect to the properties those objects have. For example, suppose some object O is blue in W1, but red in W2. Because ‘O is blue’ is true in W1 but false in W2, the strong supervenience principle requires that there be some entity that exists in one of the worlds but not the other. But ex hypothesi the two worlds have the same ontology. The advocate of strong supervenience (alongside the maximalist) requires something like a blueness trope or state of affairs (that is, O’s being blue) to exist in W1 but not W2. The contingent predication still needs a truthmaker. The advocate of weak supervenience, by contrast, does not require the contingent predication to have a truthmaker. While there is no entity that guarantees the truth of ‘O is blue’ in W1, its truth nevertheless depends on being in the sense that had it been false, there must be some difference in what exists, or in what properties those things have and what relations they stand in. The worlds where ‘O is blue’ is false are worlds where either O does not exist, or has different properties, such as being red.

Maximalism, strong supervenience, and weak supervenience are all attempts to capture the basic intuition behind truthmaker theory, and avoid the commitment to there being truths that ‘float free’ of reality. Some philosophers, however, have admitted that there are truths that do not depend on being at all, in any sense. Roy Sorensen (2001), for example, has argued that the puzzling truthteller sentence ‘This very sentence is true’ has a determinate truth value, but that it can never be known. Unlike the paradoxical liar sentence (‘This very sentence is false’), the truthteller is consistent: it can be true or false without contradiction. Sorensen argues that the truthteller is what we might call a deep truthmaker gap. Its truth does not depend on being in any sense, whereas shallow truthmaker gaps like contingent predications and negative existentials (if indeed they are truthmaker gaps) still in some sense depend on being. Sorensen argues that the truthteller’s status as a deep truthmaker gap explains why its truth value is unknowable: because we usually come to know truths by way of some kind of connection to their truthmakers, the fact that the truthteller (or its negation) lacks a truthmaker explains why we do not know its truth value.

Other forms of non-maximalism include the thesis that only ‘positive’ truths have truthmakers (however the positive/negative distinction may be articulated), that only synthetic truths have truthmakers, and that only contingent truths have truthmakers. It is incumbent upon theorists adopting such views that they explain why negative, analytic, or necessary truths are best thought of as not requiring truthmakers when accounting for their truth.

Finally, consider the following argument against maximalism, which does not turn at all on the plausibility of the various sorts of ontological truthmaking posits. Consider the sentence ‘This very sentence has no truthmaker’. This sentence is provably true (see Milne 2005). To see why, first suppose it is false. In that case, it has a truthmaker, in which case it is true: contradiction. So it must be true after all. Therefore, it has no truthmaker, since that is what it says about itself. It is a truthmaker gap. Here, simple reasoning leads to the view that there is at least one truth without a truthmaker. Many maximalists reject this argument (sometimes by assimilating it to the liar paradox), but nevertheless it remains to be seen where the reasoning goes wrong (see, for example, Rodriguez-Pereyra 2006a).

4. Kinds of Truthmakers

Truthmaker theorists are motivated by ontological questions: we can make progress on figuring out what exists by pursuing questions about what truthmakers there are. Considerations about truthmaking have thus led to different views about what exactly is included in the world’s ontology. These considerations often go hand in hand with the ancient metaphysical debate between realists and nominalists in discussions over the nature and existence of universals.

In his logical atomism, Russell just accepted as a truism the existence of facts, which are the sorts of things that make propositions true. Armstrong accepts the existence of similar objects, but he calls them ‘states of affairs’. A state of affairs is a complex object composed (in a non-mereological way) by a particular together with a universal. To offer a simplified example, suppose there is a universal of being a philosopher. Socrates instantiates this universal, and so in addition to the existence of Socrates and the universal, there is a third thing—we might call it ‘Socrates’s being a philosopher’—that is a kind of fusion of the other two.

Armstrong offers a truthmaking argument for the existence of states of affairs. It is true that Socrates is a philosopher. But Socrates does not make this claim true. Because the claim is a contingent predication, it is possible that Socrates could have existed and yet not been a philosopher. So Socrates does not necessitate the truth of ‘Socrates is a philosopher’, and so is not a truthmaker for the sentence. Nor does the universal being a philosopher necessitate ‘Socrates is a philosopher’, for it might have existed without Socrates being a philosopher. (Something else could have instantiated the universal.) Furthermore, not even the mereological sum of Socrates together with being a philosopher necessitates ‘Socrates is a philosopher’. For a world in which Socrates exists but is not a philosopher, though someone else is, is a world where the mereological sum exists but the sentence is false. On this basis, Armstrong argues that there must be something else, a state of affairs, that is a fusion of the particular and the property. Every world where the state of affairs composed by Socrates and being a philosopher is a world where ‘Socrates is a philosopher’ is true. On this basis, Armstrong defends the existence of states of affairs in the name of offering a satisfying truthmaker theory for contingent predications.

Similarly, Armstrong argues that we also need totality states of affairs in order to find truthmakers for negative and general truths. All the first-order states of affairs that exist are not enough to guarantee that there are no unicorns, or that all spheres of gold are less than a mile in diameter. So Armstrong posits the existence of a totaling relation, and second-order states of affairs partially composed by it. Again we see truthmaking considerations driving an ontological argument for the existence of entities that we might not ordinarily posit.

Not all truthmaker theorists accept Armstrong’s pro-universals and pro-states of affairs approach to truthmaker theory. Others have defended nominalist positions that reject the existence of universals, and so maintain the thesis that reality is exhausted by the particular. One popular ‘moderate’ form of nominalism is the view that there are tropes, which are individual, particularized property instances. Whereas the realist maintains that there is one unified thing, the universal of being a philosopher that is commonly instantiated by both Plato and Aristotle, the trope nominalist argues that there are two different ‘being a philosopher’ tropes: the trope associated with Plato is a distinct existence from the trope associated with Aristotle. Tropes, at least if thought of as essentially tied to their bearers, can serve as truthmakers for contingent predications. If Socrates’s being a philosopher trope exists, it must be true that Socrates is a philosopher. That trope, whose identity is bound up with Socrates, cannot in any sense be ‘transferred’ to Aristotle or anyone else. So tropes are sufficient necessitators for contingent predications. For those who find tropes ontologically advantageous over universals and states of affairs, this is a compelling argument. (It remains to be seen, however, whether trope theorists can provide truthmakers for negative and general truths, and so whether they must also, in the end, posit the existence of states of affairs.)

Another nominalist-friendly approach to truthmakers comes from David Lewis (2003), who uses counterpart theory to resist the above arguments for states of affairs and tropes. On Lewis’s view, an object exists in only one possible world, but has counterparts in different possible worlds. But there are multiple ways of thinking about objects, and so multiple ways of identifying an object’s counterparts. For example, we can use the name ‘Socrates qua philosopher’ to identify a series of counterparts to Socrates, all of whom are philosophers. Similarly, ‘Socrates qua Greek’ identifies Socrates in a way such that all his counterparts are Greek. Lewis next maintains that objects under counterpart relations can be truthmakers for contingent predications: every possible world in which Socrates qua philosopher exists is a world in which Socrates (or his counterpart) is a philosopher. So Lewis provides necessitating truthmakers for contingent predications without admitting the existence of tropes or states of affairs.

The previous arguments presuppose that contingent predications and/or negative and general truths require truthmakers. If they do, then truthmaker theorists are led to positing the existence of objects such as universals, tropes, states of affairs, and counterparts. A competing perspective, however, derives from a refusal to assume maximalist truthmaking principles, and so avoids such arguments. This alternative approach does not assume from the beginning that contingent predications and/or negative and general truths require truthmakers, and so is not ready to concede that we need an ontology of counterparts, tropes, or states of affairs. Instead of defending the existence of such entities, these truthmaker theorists defend the truth of non-maximalist truthmaker principles (as discussed in section 3). For example, advocates of the strong supervenience principle—that any difference in truth between two possible worlds requires a difference in ontology between the two worlds—believe that negative and general truths do not require truthmakers, and so, for example, Armstrong’s argument for totality states of affairs is unsuccessful. Similarly, advocates of the weak supervenience principle—that any difference in truths between two possible worlds requires either a difference in ontology or a difference in what fundamental relations objects stand in—argue that contingent predications do not require truthmakers, and so the arguments above do not succeed in showing that such posits exist.

5. Truthmaking Principles

Some very general and controversial principles concerning truthmaker theory have been canvassed above, such as maximalism, strong and weak supervenience, and principles concerning whether the truthmaking relation is irreflexive (or merely non-reflexive), asymmetric (or merely non-symmetric), or anti-transitive (or merely non-transitive). Other disputed truthmaking principles concern how truthmakers relate to one another, and what other logical principles apply in the theory of truthmaking.

One such principle in truthmaker theory is the entailment principle: if X is a truthmaker for Y, then X is a truthmaker for anything entailed by Y. For example, suppose that the state of affairs of Socrates’s being a philosopher exists, and is a truthmaker for ‘Socrates is a philosopher’. Because ‘Socrates is a philosopher’ entails ‘Something is a philosopher’, the entailment principle holds that the state of affairs of Socrates’s being a philosopher is also a truthmaker for ‘Something is a philosopher’. Furthermore, any other state of affairs involving the universal being a philosopher will also be a truthmaker for ‘Something is a philosopher’, since the truthmaking relation is not one-one.

While seemingly quite plausible, the entailment principle runs into an immediate difficulty: the problem of trivial truthmakers for necessary truths. ‘Socrates is a philosopher’ also entails ‘2 + 2 =4’, at least when entailment is thought of on the model of necessary truth preservation. Every world where ‘Socrates is a philosopher’ is true is a world where ‘2 + 2 = 4’ is true. But, presumably, the state of affairs of Socrates’s being a philosopher is not a truthmaker for ‘2 + 2 =4’, though the entailment principle suggests otherwise. In response, truthmaker theorists find ways to restrict the entailment principle, or offer alternate understandings of the kind of entailment in question. Generally speaking, truthmaker theorists attempt to articulate a hyperintensional account of entailment that is more modally discriminating than standard entailment. For example, one might think that some sort of relevance notion of entailment is at stake (for example, Restall 1996); the hope is to develop a conception of entailment that maintains that while ‘Socrates is a philosopher’ entails ‘Someone is a philosopher’, it does not entail ‘2 + 2 =4’.

Another plausible truthmaking principle—and one entailed by the entailment principle—is the conjunction principle. According to this principle, any truthmaker for a conjunction is also a truthmaker for the individual conjuncts. The conjunction principle follows from the entailment principle simply because conjuncts are entailed by the conjunctions they compose. While plausible, the principle has been doubted (for example, Rodriguez-Pereyra 2006c). The principle might seem appealing so long as we think of the truthmaking relation as tracking entailment relations. But recall that the truthmaking relation is not just a necessitation or entailment relation. As an ‘in virtue of’ relation, there is more to being a truthmaker than just being a necessitator. Take, for example, the conjunctive truth ‘Socrates exists and Aristotle exists’. A plausible truthmaker for this conjunction is the mereological sum composed by Socrates and Aristotle. If that sum exists, the conjunction has to be true. But is that mereological sum a truthmaker for the individual conjuncts? Put another way: is ‘Socrates exists’ true in virtue of the existence of the mereological sum Socrates + Aristotle? One might say: no, ‘Socrates exists’ is true in virtue of the existence of Socrates, period. The mereological sum, while a genuine necessitator of the truth of ‘Socrates exists’, is not the entity responsible for the sentence’s truth. The truthmaker for the conjunction, in effect, has ‘extraneous’ parts that are irrelevant to the truth of some of its conjuncts. Since truthmaking is thought of as a hyperintensional relation such that mere necessitation is not sufficient for truthmaking, there is room to doubt that Socrates + Aristotle is a genuine truthmaker for ‘Socrates exists’. Other philosophers who defend the conjunction principle may simply accept the sum as an adequate, albeit non-‘minimal’ truthmaker for the conjunct. (That is, the truthmaker has a proper part that is also a truthmaker.) After all, a truth may have multiple truthmakers on the standard view.

A similar candidate truthmaking principle is the disjunction principle: any truthmaker for a disjunction is a truthmaker for at least one of the disjuncts. For example, if Socrates is a truthmaker for ‘Socrates exists or Cthulhu exists’, then he is a truthmaker either for ‘Socrates exists’ or ‘Cthulhu exists’. The principle seems innocuous enough, until one considers necessary disjunctions of the form ‘p or it is not the case that p’. If one accepts the basic entailment principle, then any object whatsoever is a truthmaker for every claim of the form ‘p or it is not the case that p’. By the disjunction principle, any object whatsoever is therefore a truthmaker of either ‘p’ or ‘it is not the case that p’, depending upon which one is the true disjunct. As a result, every object is a truthmaker for every truth. This unfortunate result has led many to rethink the plausibility of the entailment and disjunction principles. (This problem may well be circumvented if a ‘relevance’ style amendment to the entailment principle is offered.)

A similar, but less controversial truthmaking principle about disjunction would be that any object that is a truthmaker for some truth is also a truthmaker for any disjunction that includes that truth as a disjunct. So since Socrates is a truthmaker for ‘Socrates exists’, he is also a truthmaker for ‘Socrates exists or Caesar sank in the Rubicon’. This sort of principle has been at work since the beginning of truthmaker theory; Russell (1985) relied on it when arguing that we need not posit a realm of disjunctive facts to make disjunctive propositions true. Atomic facts on their own suffice to serve as truthmakers for disjunctions.

6. Truthmaking and Truth

This section is a halfway house in the transition away from the internal concerns of truthmaker theory, and toward its external connections with other domains of philosophy, for it is controversial whether or not the theory of truth is a distinct domain from the theory of truthmakers. This section explores the relationship between the theory of truth and the theory of truthmakers, and surveys the possible attitudes one might take about their relationship to one another.

The history of truthmaker theory is inextricably linked with the correspondence theory. The metaphysical ambitions of Russell’s logical atomism are a natural extension of the correspondence theory of truth that he was beginning to accept around the same time period. Nowadays truthmaker theory is sometimes thought of as a modified, contemporary update of correspondence theory. It is no great mystery why. According to correspondence theories of truth, a proposition is true if and only if it stands in the correspondence relation to some worldly entity. (Oftentimes these entities are thought to be facts.) According to truthmaker theory, it seems that propositions are true if and only if they have a truthmaker; that is, a proposition is true just in case it stands in the truthmaking relation to some worldly entity, its truthmaker. If one identifies the truthmaking relation with the correspondence relation, and the set of truthmakers (facts or not) with the set of corresponding objects, then it certainly appears that truthmaker theory provides a correspondence-style theory of truth.

Notice that the above perspective presupposes maximalism. The only possible way of finding a theory of truth (let alone a correspondence theory of truth) inside truthmaker theory is to first commit to the thesis that every truth has a truthmaker. Any truthmaker gap would be an exception to anyone trying to explain the nature of truth by way of truthmakers. So the fact that maximalism is an optional requirement of truthmaker theory shows that taking truthmaker theory to be a theory of truth is also optional at best.

Even granting maximalism, anyone who seeks to define truth in terms of truthmakers still faces a crucial challenge. The truthmaking relation is itself typically understood in terms of truth. Truthmakers are objects that necessitate the truth of certain propositions, and not their other features. The accounts of the truthmaking relation canvassed in section 2 all presuppose the notion of truth. The essential dependence account, for example, holds that X is a truthmaker for Y only if Y is essentially such that it is true if X exists. Unless truthmaking can somehow be analyzed without further resort to truth, it cannot, on pain of circularity, be put to work in defining truth. Truth, it seems, is prior to truthmaking. Truthmaker theory presupposes the notion of truth, and so is not fit to serve as a theory of truth itself.

If truthmaker theory presupposes the notion of truth, does it presuppose any particular conception of truth? Again, many might think that truthmaker theory presupposes a correspondence theory of truth, or some similar substantive theory of truth. Several philosophers have also argued that truthmaker theory is incompatible with deflationary theories of truth (for example, Vision 2005). According to deflationary theories, truth is not a substantive property of propositions, in virtue of which they are true. The proposition that snow is white is not true in virtue of its having some property, or standing in a particular relation (for example, correspondence) to some object (or fact). Rather, the deflationist maintains, there is nothing more to the truth of the proposition that snow is white other than snow being white.

Accordingly, some might see deflationary theories of truth as containing an implicit rejection of truthmaker theory. As a result, truthmaker theory is incompatible with deflationary theories, and must presuppose some substantive theory of truth. (If not correspondence, there are coherence theories, pragmatic theories, epistemic theories, and others.) But it is not at all clear that anything in truthmaker theory conflicts with deflationary theories of truth. The latter tend to consist of axioms such as ‘The proposition that snow is white is true if and only if snow is white’ and ‘The proposition that Socrates is a philosopher is true if and only if Socrates is a philosopher’. These biconditionals themselves do not conflict with anything in truthmaker theory (or, typically, with any other theory of truth, either). Deflationists also maintain, in addition, that these axioms exhaust all there is to be said about the nature of truth. (It is this negative claim that substantive theories of truth must reject.) But truthmaker theorists need not be offering the claims of their theories as in any way revealing the nature of truth itself. To say that the truthmaker for the proposition that Socrates is a philosopher is a particular trope, state of affairs, or Socrates under a counterpart relation is not to say anything about the nature of truth itself. Rather, it is a claim about the particular ontological grounds needed for a particular claim about Socrates. In principle, truthmaker theorists and deflationists have nothing that they must disagree about.

7. Truthmaking and the Past

A longstanding metaphysical question concerns the reality of the past. Everyone can agree that entities in the present exist. But what about the objects that do not currently exist but someday will? And what about objects that used to exist but exist no longer? Presentism is the view that reality is exhausted by the present; the only things that exist are entities in the present. Eternalism, by contrast, is the view that there is no time limit on what exists: entities from the past are just as real as presently existing entities, which are just as real as future entities.

The existence of non-present entities is a highly contentious issue in philosophy. What is less controversial is the fact that there are, presently, truths about entities from the past. Presentists and eternalists disagree as to whether Socrates, a past entity, exists. But they agree that ‘Socrates existed’ is true. (What is more contentious is whether or not there are, right now, truths about the future. Parallel problems arise for those who think that there are truths about the future, but do not believe in the existence of purely future entities.) Eternalists face no difficulty in accounting for how such claims can be true. Socrates is the truthmaker for ‘Socrates existed’ in just the way that the Eiffel Tower is the truthmaker for ‘The Eiffel Tower exists’. Socrates and the Eiffel Tower are equally real, from the eternalist’s metaphysical point of view. One is located entirely in the past, and the other is located (but not entirely) in the present. But the present is not metaphysically privileged, so entities from the past and future are freely available to eternalists to serve as truthmakers.

Presentism, by contrast, faces a challenge from truthmaker theory. Given that there are truths about the past, but nothing (fully) from the past that exists, presentists are at pains when accounting for what, if anything, there is that can make those truths about the past true. Presentists have two available options: First, they can deny that truths about the past have truthmakers. Second, they can attempt to show that there are sufficient ontological resources in the present to ground the truths about the past.

Consider first the strategy of denying that truths about the past have truthmakers. This is a form of non-maximalism that limits truthmakers to truths about the present. Recall from section 3 that there are two distinct ways of conceiving of truthmaker gaps, that is, truths without truthmakers. There are deep truthmaker gaps, which are truths that do not depend in any way whatsoever upon what exists. Deep truthmaker gaps violate the principle that truth supervenes upon being: a deep truthmaker gap could be true in one world, but false in another, without there being any other difference between the two worlds. Shallow truthmaker gaps, by contrast, do not have truthmakers, but their truth is nonetheless ontologically accountable (by way, perhaps, of their adherence to one of the supervenience principles).

It appears that presentists cannot take advantage of the supervenience principles that have been defended by truthmaker theorists, and so appear to be forced into the view that if truths about the past are truthmaker gaps, they are deep truthmaker gaps. To see why, consider two presentist universes. These worlds are metaphysically indiscernible at the present moment: all the same things exist, and stand in the same fundamental relations. But they have different histories. In one of the universes, at some point some radioactive atom A decayed within its half-life, while a neighboring atom B did not. In the other universe, B decayed within its half-life, that is, within the predicted time it would take for half of a group of B-like atoms to radioactively decay, while A did not. So in the first universe, ‘A decayed within its half-life’ is true, while it is false in the second universe. But this difference has made no later difference in the histories of these universes, and so now, at present, the two universes are indiscernible. Yet something is true in one of them but not the other. So supervenience has been violated: they are discernible with respect to truth, but indiscernible with respect to being. Hence, presentists cannot defend a non-maximalist perspective on truths about the past without conceding that those truths are deep truthmaker gaps. But deep truthmaker gaps are highly unattractive—they make the truths in question brute, inexplicable truths. Given that eternalists have an easy, straightforward account of truthmakers for truths about the past, presentists face a serious objection. Presentists might respond by claiming that the supervenience principles need to be appropriately modified, such that truth supervenes on not just present being, but past being as well. But this response requires that present truths stand in relations to past entities, which is impossible for presentists who do not believe in past entities. If there are no past entities, there are no past entities for present truths to supervene upon.

The second strategy for presentism is to deny that there are no presently available truthmakers for truths about the past. On this kind of account, the burden is on the presentist to offer an ontological account of what present entities are available that can provide grounds for truths about the past. An eclectic menagerie of entities has been posited by presentists over the years to serve as truthmakers. Some have suggested that the world—the present world—has a variety of ‘tensed properties’ (for example, Bigelow 1996). For example, while echidnas make true ‘There are echidnas’, the world’s having the property there having been dinosaurs makes true ‘There were dinosaurs’. Others have posited a realm of ‘tensed facts’ (for example, Tallant 2009). A tensed fact is a sui generis entity posited solely to provide a truthmaker for past truths. So the truthmaker for ‘There were dinosaurs’ is on this view just an entity of some sort that we call ‘the fact that there were dinosaurs’. Still others have suggested that, for example, God’s memory of there being dinosaurs is a truthmaker for ‘There were dinosaurs’ (for example, Rhoda 2009).

Anyone can posit an entity to be a truthmaker. Such posits constitute a genuine solution to the truthmaking challenge to presentism only if those entities are the right sorts of entities to be truthmakers, and only if they are entities whose existence is plausible and can be independently motivated (lest they remain ad hoc posits). After all, the eternalist stands ready with plausible, independently motivated truthmakers. Hence, presentists do not need to just offer some account of truthmakers for past truths; they need to provide an equally good account.

Tensed facts fail both sorts of challenges. Consider Socrates’s last moments, as the hemlock spread through his blood. During those moments, ‘Socrates exists’ was true, and made true by Socrates. A few moments later, ‘Socrates existed’ is true, and made true by a tensed fact that has just sprung into existence. That two truths so similar should be made true by such drastically different entities should be fairly disquieting. Socrates seems to be the perfect sort of thing to explain why ‘Socrates exists’ is true. After all, the sentence is about Socrates, a human being, and so a human being seems fit to provide the grounds for its truth. ‘Socrates existed’ is also about a human being, but now the supposed truthmaker is some sort of sui generis entity, something that is certainly composed in no way by a human being. There is no independent reason to believe in tensed facts; they are put forward as truthmakers for truths about the past by brute force, since it is unclear what they are apart from their stipulated role of being truthmakers for truths about the past.

Tensed property views face a similar sort of objection. ‘Socrates exists’ is true at some moment in virtue of Socrates. ‘Socrates existed’ is true the next moment, but in virtue of the world’s having some tensed property. Why, one might wonder, is not ‘Socrates exists’ true, when it is true, in virtue of the world having the tensed property presently containing Socrates? If such properties are not motivated to account for the present, it is unclear why we should posit them to account for the past.

In general, any strategy using presently existing entities to make true truths about the past will face a common explanatory problem (Sanson and Caplan 2010). Why are truths about the past true in virtue of things in the present? After all, truths about the past seem to be about the past, and so it is unclear how anything not from the past could be an adequate explanation of why they are true. Truthmakers are not mere necessitators; they have to give the right sort of grounds for their truths. God’s memory of there being Socrates certainly necessitates the truth of ‘Socrates existed’. But it is fair to claim that ‘Socrates existed’ is not true in virtue of God’s having a particular memory. (To deny this seems to accept some form of divine idealism.) So God’s memories aren’t the right kind of thing to make true ‘Socrates existed’. (To the view’s credit, the existence of God’s memories can at least be motivated independently—for anyone motivated to believe in God. The view is obviously a non-starter for naturalistic metaphysics.)

8. Truthmaking and Modality

Another traditionally problematic domain of truths are the modal claims: claims involving possibility and necessity, as well as related kinds of claims such as counterfactuals. For example, there are claims about mere possibilities, that is, possibilities that do not obtain, but could have. There are also necessary and impossible truths, and truths that those truths are necessary or impossible. Since such claims appear to concern a realm beyond the actual world, the grounds for their truth have long intrigued metaphysicians.

Though defended independently of his views about truthmaking, David Lewis’s modal realism can be put to work as a theory of truthmakers for some modal truths. According to Lewis, there exists, in addition to the actual world, infinitely many other concrete worlds. These other possible worlds are just as real as the actual world; the actual world bears no special metaphysical significance. While objects exist only in one possible world, they have counterparts in other worlds. An object’s counterparts are the entities in other possible worlds that are highly similar to the object (where similarity is explicated contextually). These counterparts can serve as truthmakers for modal truths concerning the actual world. For example, Socrates could have been a sophist. What makes that true, Lewis could maintain, is one of Socrates’s sophistic counterparts. Because there exists a counterpart of Socrates that is a sophist, ‘Socrates could have been a sophist’ is true in the actual world. At the same time, this view might face a relevance objection: the truth in question is a claim about Socrates, so how could it be made true by some individual existing in a separate, causally isolated possible world?

Armstrong hopes for a more austere account of the truthmakers for truths of mere possibility. To do this, he defends the principle that any truthmaker for a contingent truth is also a truthmaker for the truth that that truth is contingent. So, if some object X is a truthmaker for some contingent proposition that p, then X is a truthmaker for the truth that it is contingent that p. And if it is contingent that p, it follows that it is possible that it is not the case that p. X will therefore provide a truthmaker for the truth of mere possibility (assuming the truth of the right sort of entailment principle). For example, Socrates might not have been a philosopher, even though he was. Suppose the truthmaker for ‘Socrates is a philosopher’ is the state of affairs of Socrates’s being a philosopher. In that case, Socrates’s being a philosopher also makes it true that it is contingent that Socrates is a philosopher. By the entailment principle, Socrates’s being a philosopher is also a truthmaker for the claim that it is possible that Socrates is not a philosopher. In this way, Armstrong defends an account of truthmakers for truths of mere possibilities that does not employ resources above and beyond the ordinary truthmakers needed to grounds truths solely about the actual world.

As for necessary truths (and claims that such truths are necessary), most truthmaker theorists are agreed that not just any old entity will do, since mere necessitation is not sufficient for truthmaking. If it is true that God exists, and necessarily so, then presumably God is the truthmaker for such claims, not every object whatsoever. What is more contentious is what it is that makes mathematical statements true. Platonists might defend their view on the basis that numbers, understood Platonically, are necessary for giving an account of truthmakers for mathematical truths (for example, Baron 2013). Others might hope for a non-Platonic basis for mathematical truthmakers. Since it is agreed that truthmakers need to be ‘about’ or relevant to their corresponding truths, non-Platonists face the challenge of explaining how their purported truthmakers ground the truth of claims that at least appear to concern Platonic entities.

There are many more modal cases to keep truthmaker theorists busy. There are truths of natural necessity (for example, that all copper conducts electricity), conceptual truths (for example, that all bachelors are male), and logical truths (for example, that someone is human only if someone is human). All pose unique challenges for truthmaker theory.

9. Objections to Truthmaker Theory

Many philosophers are unmoved by truthmaker theory. A common thread running between the various objections that have been raised is that truthmaker theory lacks the sufficient motivation that would be necessary to justify its ontological posits. Truthmaker theory traditionally defends the existence of ontologically controversial entities (such as states of affairs or tropes), and so such posits should figure into theories only when they have some indispensable theoretical role to play. And many are convinced that no such role exists.

One line of objection maintains that truthmaker principles that are weaker than maximalism are not worthy of the name, and that the ontological posits required for maximalism are unacceptable. So no form of truthmaker theory is tenable. (See, for example, Dodd 2002 and Merricks 2007.) Such objections rely on conceptions of truthmaker theory that are substantially narrower than what is actually found in the literature; non-maximalists will be unmoved by such supposed refutations. It is up to truthmaker theorists, not their opponents, to decide who counts as a truthmaker theorist.

Another common style of objection is to claim that the intuitions behind truthmaker theory can be saved far more economically by ontologically innocuous principles (for example, Hornsby 2005). As a result, the key but controversial principles supporting truthmaker theory (and the ontological results they produce) are unmotivated, and so should be rejected. The objection runs as follows. As above, a central motivating thought behind truthmaker theory is that truth depends on reality. Maximalists account for this intuition by way of requiring that every truth be made true by some entity, in virtue of which that truth is true. Non-maximalists might look to the strong or weak supervenience principles to explain how what is true is not independent from what exists and how those things are arranged. But other philosophers find these principles to be overreactions to the idea that truth depends on being. For these philosophers, that idea is best cashed out by pointing to the instances of the following schema:

The proposition that p is true because p.

For instance, the proposition that Socrates is a philosopher is true because Socrates is a philosopher. According to the objection, this ‘because principle’ suffices to explain how the truth of the proposition that Socrates is a philosopher depends upon reality. After all, this maneuver seems to capture the asymmetry between truth and reality. For instances of the reverse schema are false:

p because the proposition that p is true.

It is not the case that Socrates is a philosopher because the proposition that Socrates is a philosopher is true. Hence, there is no need to entertain the existence of a state of affairs or trope, and no need to posit general claims about the supervenience of truth on being.

The most natural response for truthmaker theorists to make is that the above ‘because principles’ remain silent on the questions of interest to truthmaker theorists. Advocates of the objection claim that such principles express the appropriate dependency between truth and reality. But there is no mention of reality anywhere in the principles. Consider what is being expressed by the ‘because principles’. They appear to apply a relation—the ‘because’ relation—between two sentences, or perhaps two propositions. The first sentence applies truth to a proposition; the second is just the use of a sentence that expresses that proposition. The ‘because principle’ cannot be expressing a relation involving entities such as facts or states of affairs, since the objector does not believe in the need for an ontology of those kinds of things. In fact, one can endorse a ‘because principle’ without taking any metaphysical or ontological stand about anything. The sentence ‘Socrates is a philosopher’ is completely silent on what exists. The sentence itself does not tell you what its ontological commitments are; one must bring to the sentence a theory of ontological commitment or truthmaking in order to determine what its metaphysical implications are. Presumably, advocates of the ‘because principles’ think that the used sentence following ‘because’ somehow involves reality. In so doing, they betray the fact that they are reading ontological implications already into the sentence. They are bringing, in other words, an implicit theory of truthmaking to the table.

Consider again the sorts of suspicious counterfactual conditionals that motivated truthmaker theory in the first place. The counterfactual ‘If I were to go to the quad I would have a tree-like sensory impression’ appears to be true, and true in virtue of the existence of a real, live tree in the quadrangle courtyard. That is the view that puts pressure on ontologies limited to actual sensory impressions: they have no available truthmakers for such counterfactuals, and so must take such claims to be primitive, brute truths. The objector to truthmaker theory points out that the proposition that if I were to go to the quad I would have a tree-like sensory impression is true because if I were to go to the quad I would have a tree-like sensory impression. That is true, but beside the point. It does not explain the need for something to exist in order for something to be true. We’re left wondering why I would have a tree-like sensory impression if I were to go to the quad. All the ‘because principle’ does (at least on the readings available to the objector) is cite a relation that obtains between two sentences or propositions; but truthmaker theorists are after a relation between truth and reality.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. M. 2004. Truth and Truthmakers. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
    • A systematic account of truthmaker theory by one of its most established proponents.
  • Baron, Sam. 2013. A truthmaker indispensability argument. Synthese 190: 2413-2427.
    • Argues for mathematical Platonism on the basis of certain truthmaking considerations.
  • Beebee, Helen and Julian Dodd. 2005. Truthmakers: The Contemporary Debate. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • An anthology of various essays both critical and supportive of truthmaker theory.
  • Bigelow, John. 1988. The Reality of Numbers: A Physicalist’s Philosophy of Mathematics. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Defends the strong supervenience principle, offering a non-maximalist approach to truthmaker theory.
  • Bigelow, John. 1996. Presentism and properties. Philosophical Perspectives 10: 35-52.
    • Discusses the relationship between truthmaker theory and presentism; defends the view that truths about the past have truthmakers in the present.
  • Cameron, Ross P. 2008. Truthmakers and ontological commitment: or how to deal with complex objects and mathematical ontology without getting into trouble. Philosophical Studies 140: 1-18.
    • Defends a view that requires truthmakers to be fundamental entities.
  • Caplan, Ben and David Sanson. 2011. Presentism and truthmaking. Philosophy Compass 6: 196-208.
    • Provides an accessible introduction to presentism and truthmaker theory.
  • Dodd, Julian. 2002. Is truth supervenient on being? Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (New Series) 102: 69-85.
    • Argues that truthmaker theory is unmotivated.
  • Hornsby, Jennifer. 2005. Truth without truthmaking entities. In Truthmakers: The Contemporary Debate, eds. Helen Beebee and Julian Dodd, 33-47. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Argues that the intuitions behind truthmaking can be captured without resort to contentious ontological posits.
  • Lewis, David. 2001. Truthmaking and difference-making. Noûs 35: 602-615.
    • Provides an important critical perspective on maximalist truthmaker theory that relies on defending the weak supervenience principle.
  • Lewis, David. 2003. Things qua truthmakers. In Real Metaphysics: Essays in Honour of D. H. Mellor, eds. Hallvard Lillehammer and Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra, 25-42. London: Routledge.
    • Provides a nominalist-friendly account of truthmaker theory that employs counterpart theory.
  • Lowe, E. J. 2009. An essentialist approach to truth-making. In Truth and Truth-Making, eds. E. J. Lowe and A. Rami, 201-216. Stocksfield: Acumen.
    • Defends the view that the truthmaking relation is a kind of essential dependence.
  • Lowe, E. J. and A. Rami, eds. 2009. Truth and Truth-Making. Stocksfield: Acumen.
    • An anthology of papers on truthmaker theory, including several on this list, that provides an introduction to core issues in truthmaker theory.
  • MacBride, Fraser. 2014. Truthmakers. In The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2014 Edition), ed. Edward N. Zalta.
    • Provides a detailed overview of several main theoretical concerns within truthmaker theory.
  • Mellor, D. H. 2003. Real metaphysics: replies. In Real Metaphysics: Essays in Honour of D. H. Mellor, eds. Hallvard Lillehammer and Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra, 212-238. London: Routledge.
    • Offers an argument that the truthmaking relation does not require necessitation.
  • Merricks, Trenton. 2007. Truth and Ontology. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Offers a sustained and ultimately negative critical evaluation of truthmaker theory.
  • Milne, Peter. 2005. Not every truth has a truthmaker. Analysis 65: 221-224.
    • Raises a potential paradox for maximalism.
  • Molnar, George. 2000. Truthmakers for negative truths. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 78: 72-86.
    • Introduces and discusses the problem of negative truths for truthmaker theory.
  • Mulligan, Kevin, Peter Simons and Barry Smith. 1984. Truth-makers. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 44: 287-321.
    • Offers a non-maximalist approach to truthmaker theory without resorting to states of affairs that begins by finding truthmakers for atomic facts.
  • Restall, Greg. 1996. Truthmakers, entailment and necessity. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 331-340.
    • Discusses problems (such as that related to the disjunction principle) with treating the truthmaking relation merely as a relation of necessitation.
  • Rhoda, Alan R. 2009. Presentism, truthmakers, and God. Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 90: 41-62.
    • Posits the existence of God’s memories as providing presentist-friendly truthmakers for truths about the past.
  • Rodriguez-Pereyra, Gonzalo. 2006a. Truthmaker Maximalism defended. Analysis 66: 260-264.
    • Defends truthmaker maximalism against Milne’s argument on the grounds that it begs the question.
  • Rodriguez-Pereyra, Gonzalo. 2006b. Truthmakers. Philosophy Compass 1: 186-200.
    • Provides a highly accessible introduction to central issues in truthmaker theory.
  • Rodriguez-Pereyra, Gonzalo. 2006c. Truthmaking, entailment, and the conjunction thesis. Mind (New Series) 115: 957-982.
    • Argues against certain core principles discussed in the truthmaking literature.
  • Russell, Bertrand. 1985. The Philosophy of Logical Atomism. ed. David Pears. La Salle, IL: Open Court.
    • An early work that makes use of truthmaking ideas that gave rise to and inspired future contemporary work on truthmakers.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. 1949. The Concept of Mind. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
    • Presents Ryle’s behaviorism that becomes a later target of truthmaker theory.
  • Sanson, David and Ben Caplan. 2010. The way things were. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 81: 24-39.
    • Argues against various defenses of truthmakers for presentism on the ground that such posits are insufficiently explanatory.
  • Sorensen, Roy. 2001. Vagueness and Contradiction. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • In the last chapter of this book Sorensen argues that the truthtelling sentence ‘This very sentence is true’ is a deep truthmaker gap: a truth without a truthmaker that depends in no way upon reality.
  • Tallant, Jonathan. 2009. Presentism and truth-making. Erkenntnis 71: 407-416.
    • Discusses various strategies for presentist truthmaking.
  • Vision, Gerald. 2005. Deflationary truthmaking. European Journal of Philosophy 13: 364-380.
    • Discusses the relationship between truthmaker theory and the deflationary theory of truth, and finds the two projects difficult to combine.


Author Information

Jamin Asay
University of Hong Kong
Hong Kong


clock2Time is what we use a clock to measure. Despite 2,500 years of investigation into the nature of time, many issues about it are unresolved. Here is a list in no particular order of the most important issues that are discussed in this article: •What time actually is; •Whether time exists when nothing is changing; •What kinds of time travel are possible; •How time is related to mind; •Why time has an arrow; •Whether the future and past are as real as the present; •How to correctly analyze the metaphor of time’s flow; •Whether contingent sentences about the future have truth values now; •Whether future time will be infinite; •Whether there was time before our Big Bang; •Whether tensed or tenseless concepts are semantically basic; •What the proper formalism or logic is for capturing the special role that time plays in reasoning; •What neural mechanisms account for our experience of time; •Which aspects of time are conventional; and •Whether there is a timeless substratum from which time emerges.

Consider this one issue upon which philosophers are deeply divided: What sort of ontological differences are there among the present, the past and the future? There are three competing theories. Presentists argue that necessarily only present objects and present experiences are real, and we conscious beings recognize this in the special vividness of our present experience compared to our memories of past experiences and our expectations of future experiences. So, the dinosaurs have slipped out of reality. However, according to the growing-past theory, the past and present are both real, but the future is not real because the future is indeterminate or merely potential. Dinosaurs are real, but our death is not. The third theory is that there are no objective ontological differences among present, past, and future because the differences are merely subjective. This third theory is called “eternalism.”

Table of Contents

  1. What Should a Philosophical Theory of Time Do?
  2. How Is Time Related to Mind?
  3. What Is Time?
    1. The Variety of Answers
    2. Time vs. “Time”
    3. Linear and Circular Time
    4. The Extent of Time
    5. Does Time Emerge from Something More Basic?
    6. Time and Conventionality
  4. What Does Science Require of Time?
  5. What Kinds of Time Travel are Possible?
  6. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)
  7. Does Time Flow?
    1. McTaggart's A-Series and B-Series
    2. Subjective Flow and Objective Flow
  8. What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?
    1. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism, and the Block-Universe
    2. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?
    3. Persist, Endure, Perdure, and Four-Dimensionalism
    4. Truth Values and Free Will
  9. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?
  10. What Gives Time Its Direction or Arrow?
    1. Time without an Arrow
    2. What Needs To Be Explained
    3. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow
    4. Multiple Arrows
    5. Reversing the Arrow
  11. What is Temporal Logic?
  12. Supplements
    1. Frequently Asked Questions
    2. What Science Requires of Time
    3. Special Relativity: Proper Times, Coordinate Systems, and Lorentz Transformations (by Andrew Holster)
  13. References and Further Reading

1. What Should a Philosophical Theory of Time Do?

Philosophers of time tend to divide into two broad camps on some of the key philosophical issues, although many philosophers do not fit into these pigeonholes. Members of  the A-camp say that McTaggart's A-series is the fundamental way to view time; events are always changing, the now is objectively real and so is time's flow; ontologically we should accept either presentism or the growing-past theory; predictions are not true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are semantically basic; and the ontologically fundamental entities are 3-dimensional objects. Members of the B-camp say that McTaggart's B-series is the fundamental way to view time; events are never changing; the now is not objectively real and neither is time's flow; ontologically we should accept eternalism and the block-universe theory; predictions are true or false at the time they are uttered; tenses are not semantically basic; and the fundamental entities are 4-dimensional events or processes. This article provides an introduction to this controversy between the camps.

However, there are many other issues about time whose solutions do not fit into one or the other of the above two camps. (i) Does time exist only for beings who have minds? (ii) Can time exist if no event is happening anywhere? (iii) What sorts of time travel are possible? (iv) Why does time have an arrow? (v) Is the concept of time inconsistent?

A full theory of time should address this constellation of philosophical issues about time. Narrower theories of time will focus on resolving one or more members of this constellation, but the long-range goal is to knit together these theories into a full, systematic, and detailed theory of time. Philosophers also ask whether to adopt  a realist or anti-realist interpretation of a theory of time, but this article does not explore this subtle metaphysical question.

2. How Is Time Related to Mind?

Physical time is public time, the time that clocks are designed to measure. Biological time, by contrast, is indicated by an organism's circadian rhythm or body clock, which is normally regulated by the pattern of sunlight and darkness. Psychological time is different from both physical time and biological time. Psychological time is private time. It is also called phenomenological time, and it is perhaps best understood as awareness of physical time. Psychological time passes relatively swiftly for us while we are enjoying an activity, but it slows dramatically if we are waiting anxiously for the  pot of water to boil on the stove. The slowness is probably due to focusing our attention on short intervals of physical time. Meanwhile, the clock by the stove is measuring physical time and is not affected by any person’s awareness or by any organism's biological time.

When a physicist defines speed to be the rate of change of position with respect to time, the term “time” refers to physical time, not psychological time or biological time. Physical time is more basic or fundamental than psychological time for helping us understand our shared experiences in the world, and so it is more useful for doing physical science, but psychological time is vitally important for understanding many mental experiences.

Psychological time is faster for older people than for children, as you notice when your grandmother says, "Oh, it's my birthday again." That is, an older person's psychological time is faster relative to physical time. Psychological time is slower or faster depending upon where we are in the spectrum of conscious experience: awake normally, involved in a daydream,  sleeping normally, drugged with anesthetics, or in a coma. Some philosophers claim that psychological time is completely transcended in the mental state called nirvana because psychological time slows to a complete stop. There is general agreement among philosophers that, when we are awake normally, we do not experience time as stopping and starting.

A major philosophical problem is to explain the origin and character of our temporal experiences. Philosophers continue to investigate, but so far do not agree on, how our experience of temporal phenomena produces our consciousness of our experiencing temporal phenomena. With the notable exception of Husserl, most philosophers say our ability to imagine other times is a necessary ingredient in our having any consciousness at all. Many philosophers also say people in a coma have a low level of consciousness, yet when a person awakes from a coma they can imagine other times but have no good sense about how long they've been in the coma.

We make use of our ability to imagine other times when we experience a difference between our present perceptions and our present memories of past perceptions.  Somehow the difference between the two gets interpreted by us as evidence that the world we are experiencing is changing through time, with some events succeeding other events. Locke said our train of ideas produces our idea that events succeed each other in time, but he offered no details on how this train does the producing.

Philosophers also want to know which aspects of time we have direct experience of, and which we have only indirect experience of. Is our direct experience of only of the momentary present, as Aristotle, Thomas Reid, and Alexius Meinong believed, or instead do we have direct experience of what William James called a "specious present," a short stretch of physical time? Among those accepting the notion of a specious present, there is continuing controversy about whether the individual specious presents can overlap each other and about how the individual specious presents combine to form our stream of consciousness.

The brain takes an active role in building a mental scenario of what is taking place beyond the brain. For one example, the "time dilation effect" in psychology occurs when events involving an object coming toward you last longer in psychological time than an event with the same object being stationary. For another example, try tapping your nose with one hand and your knee with your other hand at the same time. Even though it takes longer for the signal from your knee to reach your brain than the signal from your nose to reach your brain, you will have the experience of the two tappings being simultaneous—thanks to the brain's manipulation of the data. Neuroscientists suggest that your brain waits about 80 milliseconds for all the relevant input to come in before you experience a “now.” Craig Callender surveyed the psycho-physics literature on human experience of the present, and concluded that, if the duration in physical time between two experienced events is less than about a quarter of a second (250 milliseconds), then humans will say both events happened simultaneously, and this duration is slightly different for different people but is stable within the experience of any single person. Also, "our impression of subjective present-ness...can be manipulated in a variety of ways" such as by what other sights or sounds are present at nearby times. See (Callender 2003-4, p. 124) and (Callender 2008).

Within the field of cognitive science, researchers want to know what are the neural mechanisms that account for our experience of time—for our awareness of change, for our sense of time’s flow, for our ability to place events into the proper time order (temporal succession), and for our ability to notice, and often accurately estimate, durations (persistence). The most surprising experimental result about our experience of time is Benjamin Libet’s claim in the 1970s that his experiments show that the brain events involved in initiating our free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our choice. Before Libet’s work, it was universally agreed that a person is aware of deciding to act freely, then later the body initiates the action. Libet's work has been used to challenge this universal claim about decisions. However, Libet's own experiments have been difficult to repeat because he drilled through the skull and inserted electrodes to shock the underlying brain tissue. See (Damasio 2002) for more discussion of Libet's experiments.

Neuroscientists and psychologists have investigated whether they can speed up our minds relative to a duration of physical time. If so, we might become mentally more productive, and get more high quality decision making done per fixed amount of physical time, and learn more per minute. Several avenues have been explored: using cocaine, amphetamines and other drugs; undergoing extreme experiences such as jumping backwards off a tall bridge with bungee cords attached to one's ankles; and trying different forms of meditation. So far, none of these avenues have led to success productivity-wise.

Any organism’s sense of time is subjective, but is the time that is sensed also subjective, a mind-dependent phenomenon? Throughout history, philosophers of time have disagreed on the answer. Without minds in the world, nothing in the world would be surprising or beautiful or interesting. Can we add that nothing would be in time? The majority answer is "no." The ability of the concept of time to help us make sense of our phenomenological evidence involving change, persistence, and succession of events is a sign that time may be objectively real. Consider succession, that is, order of events in time. We all agree that our memories of events occur after the events occur. If judgments of time were subjective in the way judgments of being interesting vs. not-interesting are subjective, then it would be too miraculous that everyone can so easily agree on the ordering of events in time. For example, first Einstein was born, then he went to school, then he died. Everybody agrees that it happened in this order: birth, school, death. No other order. The agreement on time order for so many events, both psychological events and physical events, is part of the reason that most philosophers and scientists believe physical time is an objective and not dependent on being consciously experienced.

Another large part of the reason to believe time is objective is that our universe has so many different processes that bear consistent time relations, or frequency of occurrence relations, to each other. For example, the frequency of rotation of the Earth around its axis is a constant multiple of the frequency of oscillation of a fixed-length pendulum, which in turn is a constant multiple of the half life of a specific radioactive uranium isotope, which in turn is a multiple of the frequency of a vibrating violin string; the relationship of these oscillators does not change as time goes by (at least not much and not for a long time, and when there is deviation we know how to predict it and compensate for it). The existence of these sorts of relationships makes our system of physical laws much simpler than it otherwise would be, and it makes us more confident that there is something objective we are referring to with the time-variable in those laws. The stability of these relationships over a long time makes it easy to create clocks. Time can be measured easily because we have access to long-term simple harmonic oscillators that have a regular period or “regular ticking.” This regularity shows up in completely different stable systems: rotations of the Earth, a swinging ball hanging from a string (a pendulum), a bouncing ball hanging from a coiled spring, revolutions of the Earth around the Sun, oscillating electric circuits, and vibrations of a quartz crystal. Many of these systems make good clocks. The existence of these possibilities for clocks strongly suggests that time is objective, and is not merely an aspect of consciousness.

The issue about objectivity vs. subjectivity is related to another issue: realism vs. idealism. Is time real or instead just a useful instrument or just a useful convention or perhaps an arbitrary convention? This issue will appear several times throughout this article, including in the later section on conventionality.

Aristotle raised this issue of the mind-dependence of time when he said, “Whether, if soul (mind) did not exist, time would exist or not, is a question that may fairly be asked; for if there cannot be someone to count there cannot be anything that can be counted…” (Physics, chapter 14). He does not answer his own question because, he says rather profoundly, it depends on whether time is the conscious numbering of movement or instead is just the capability of movements being numbered were consciousness to exist.

St. Augustine, adopting a subjective view of time, said time is nothing in reality but exists only in the mind’s apprehension of that reality. The 13th century philosophers Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome said time exists in reality as a mind-independent continuum, but is distinguished into earlier and later parts only by the mind. In the 13th century, Duns Scotus clearly recognized both physical and psychological time.

At the end of the 18th century, Kant suggested a subtle relationship between time and mind–that our mind actually structures our perceptions so that we can know a priori that time is like a mathematical line. Time is, on this theory, a form of conscious experience, and our sense of time is a necessary condition of our having experiences such as sensations. In the 19th century, Ernst Mach claimed instead that our sense of time is a simple sensation, not an a priori form of sensation. This controversy took another turn when other philosophers argued that both Kant and Mach were incorrect because our sense of time is, instead, an intellectual construction (see Whitrow 1980, p. 64).

In the 20th century, the philosopher of science Bas van Fraassen described time, including physical time, by saying, “There would be no time were there no beings capable of reason” just as “there would be no food were there no organisms, and no teacups if there were no tea drinkers.”

The controversy in metaphysics between idealism and realism is that, for the idealist, nothing exists independently of the mind. If this controversy is settled in favor of idealism, then physical time, too, would have that subjective feature.

It has been suggested by some philosophers that Einstein’s theory of relativity, when confirmed, showed us that physical time depends on the observer, and thus that physical time is subjective, or dependent on the mind. This error is probably caused by Einstein’s use of the term “observer.” Einstein’s theory implies that the duration of an event depends on the observer’s frame of reference or coordinate system, but what Einstein means by “observer’s frame of reference” is merely a perspective or coordinate framework from which measurements could be made. The “observer” need not have a mind. So, Einstein is not making a point about mind-dependence.

To mention one last issue about the relationship between mind and time, if all organisms were to die, there would be events after those deaths. The stars would continue to shine, for example, but would any of these events be in the future? This is a controversial question because advocates of McTaggart’s A-theory will answer “yes,” whereas advocates of McTaggart’s B-theory will answer “no” and say “whose future?”

For more on the consciousness of time and related issues, see the article “Phenomenology and Time-Consciousness.” For more on whether the present, as opposed to time itself, is subjective, see the section called "Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?"

3. What Is Time?

Physical time seems to be objective, whereas psychological time is subjective. Many philosophers of science argue that physical time is more fundamental even though psychological time is discovered first by each of us during our childhood, and even though psychological time was discovered first as we human beings evolved from our animal ancestors. The remainder of this article focuses more on physical time than psychological time.

Time is what we use a clock or calendar to measure. We can say time is composed of all the instants or all the times, but that word "times" is ambiguous and also means measurements of time. Think of our placing a coordinate system on our spacetime (this cannot be done successfully in all spacetimes) as our giving names to spacetime points. The measurements we make of time are numbers variously called times, dates, clock readings, and temporal coordinates; and these numbers are relative to time zones and reference frames and conventional agreements about how to define the second, the conventional unit for measuring time. It is because of what time is that we can succeed in assigning time numbers in this manner. Another feature of time is that we can place all events in a single reference frame into a linear sequence one after the other according to their times of occurrence; for any two instants, they are either simultaneous or else one happens before the other but not vice versa. A third feature is that we can succeed in coherently specifying with real numbers how long an event lasts; this is the duration between the event's beginning instant and its ending instant. These are three key features of time, but they do not quite tell us what time itself is.

In discussion about time, the terminology is often ambiguous. We have just mentioned that care is often not taken in distinguishing time from the measure of time. Here are some additional comments about terminology: A moment is said to be a short time, a short event, and to have a short duration or short interval ("length" of time). Comparing a moment to an instant, a moment is brief, but an instant is even briefer. An instant is usually thought to have either a zero duration or else a duration so short as not to be detectable.

a. The Variety of Answers

We cannot trip over a moment of time nor enclose it in a box, so what exactly are moments? Are they created by humans analogous to how, according to some constructivist philosophers, mathematical objects are created by humans, and once created then they have well-determined properties some of which might be difficult for humans to discover? Or is time more like a Platonic idea? Or is time an emergent feature of changes in analogy to how a sound wave is an emergent features the molecules of a vibrating tuning fork, with no single molecule making a sound? When we know what time is, then we can answer all these questions.

One answer to our question, “What is time?” is that time is whatever the time variable t is denoting in the best-confirmed and most fundamental theories of current science. “Time” is given an implicit definition this way. Nearly all philosophers would agree that we do learn much about physical time by looking at the behavior of the time variable in these theories; but they complain that the full nature of physical time can be revealed only with a philosophical theory of time that addresses the many philosophical issues that scientists do not concern themselves with.

Physicists often say time is a sequence of moments in a linear order. Presumably a moment is a durationless instant. Michael Dummett’s constructive model of time implies instead that time is a composition of intervals rather than of durationless instants. The model is constructive in the sense that it implies there do not exist any times which are not detectable in principle by a physical process.

One answer to the question "What is time?" is that it is a general feature of the actual changes in the universe so that if all changes are reversed then time itself reverses. This answer is called "relationism" and "relationalism." A competing answer is that time is more like a substance in that it exists independently of relationships among changes or events. These two competing answers to our question are explored in a later section.

A popular post-Einstein answer to "What is time?" is that time is a single dimension of spacetime.

Because time is intimately related to change, the answer to our question is likely to depend on our answer to the question, "What is change?" The most popular type of answer here is that change is an alteration in the properties of some enduring thing, for example, the alteration from green to brown of an enduring leaf. A different type of answer is that change is basically a sequence of states, such as a sequence containing a state in which the leaf is green and a state in which the leaf is brown. This issue won't be pursued here, and the former answer will be presumed at several places later in the article.

Before the creation of Einstein's special theory of relativity, it might have been said that time must provide these four things: (1) For any event, it specifies when it occurs. (2) For any event, it specifies its duration—how long it lasts. (3) For any event, it fixes what other events are simultaneous with it. (4) For any pair of events that are not simultaneous, it specifies which happens first. With the creation of the special theory of relativity in 1905, it was realized that these questions can get different answers in different frames of reference.

Bothered by the contradictions they claimed to find in our concept of time, Zeno, Plato, Spinoza, Hegel, and McTaggart answer the question, “What is time?” by replying that it is nothing because it does not exist (LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993, p. 23). In a similar vein, the early 20th century English philosopher F. H. Bradley argued, “Time, like space, has most evidently proved not to be real, but a contradictory appearance….The problem of change defies solution.” In the mid-twentieth century, Gödel argued for the unreality of time because Einstein's equations allow for physically possible worlds in which events precede themselves.  In the twenty-first century some physicists such as Julian Barbour say that in order to reconcile general relativity with quantum mechanics either time does not exist or else it is not fundamental in nature; see (Callender 2010) for a discussion of this. However, most philosophers agree that time does exist. They just cannot agree on what it is.

Let’s briefly explore other answers that have been given throughout history to our question, “What is time?” Aristotle claimed that “time is the measure of change” (Physics, chapter 12). He never said space is a measure of anything. Aristotle emphasized “that time is not change [itself]” because a change “may be faster or slower, but not time…” (Physics, chapter 10). For example, a specific change such as the descent of a leaf can be faster or slower, but time itself cannot be faster or slower. In developing his views about time, Aristotle advocated what is now referred to as the relational theory when he said, “there is no time apart from change….” (Physics, chapter 11). In addition, Aristotle said time is not discrete or atomistic but “is continuous…. In respect of size there is no minimum; for every line is divided ad infinitum. Hence it is so with time” (Physics, chapter 11).

René Descartes had a very different answer to “What is time?” He argued that a material body has the property of spatial extension but no inherent capacity for temporal endurance, and that God by his continual action sustains (or re-creates) the body at each successive instant. Time is a kind of sustenance or re-creation ("Third Meditation" in Meditations on First Philosophy).

In the 17th century, the English physicist Isaac Barrow rejected Aristotle’s linkage between time and change. Barrow said time is something which exists independently of motion or change and which existed even before God created the matter in the universe. Barrow’s student, Isaac Newton, agreed with this substantival theory of time. Newton argued very specifically that time and space are an infinitely large container for all events, and that the container exists with or without the events. He added that space and time are not material substances, but are like substances in not being dependent on anything except God.

Gottfried Leibniz objected. He argued that time is not an entity existing independently of actual events. He insisted that Newton had underemphasized the fact that time necessarily involves an ordering of any pair of non-simultaneous events. This is why time “needs” events, so to speak. Leibniz added that this overall order is time. He accepted a relational theory of time and rejected a substantival theory.

In the 18th century, Immanuel Kant said time and space are forms that the mind projects upon the external things-in-themselves. He spoke of our mind structuring our perceptions so that space always has a Euclidean geometry, and time has the structure of the mathematical line. Kant’s idea that time is a form of apprehending phenomena is probably best taken as suggesting that we have no direct perception of time but only the ability to experience things and events in time. Some historians distinguish perceptual space from physical space and say that Kant was right about perceptual space. It is difficult, though, to get a clear concept of perceptual space. If physical space and perceptual space are the same thing, then Kant is claiming we know a priori that physical space is Euclidean. With the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 1820s, and with increased doubt about the reliability of Kant’s method of transcendental proof, the view that truths about space and time are a priori truths began to lose favor.

The above discussion does not exhaust all the claims about what time is. And there is no sharp line separating a definition of time, a theory of time, and an explanation of time.

b. Time vs. “Time”

Whatever time is, it is not “time.” “Time” is the most common noun in all documents on the Internet's web pages; time is not. Nevertheless, it might help us understand time if we improved our understanding of the sense of the word “time.” Should the proper answer to the question “What is time?” produce a definition of the word as a means of capturing its sense? No. At least not if the definition must be some analysis that provides a simple paraphrase in all its occurrences. There are just too many varied occurrences of the word: time out, behind the times, in the nick of time, and so forth.

But how about narrowing the goal to a definition of the word “time” in its main sense, the sense that most interests philosophers and physicists? That is, explore the usage of the word “time” in its principal sense as a means of learning what time is. Well, this project would require some consideration of the grammar of the word “time.” Most philosophers today would agree with A. N. Prior who remarked that, “there are genuine metaphysical problems, but I think you have to talk about grammar at least a little bit in order to solve most of them.” However, do we learn enough about what time is when we learn about the grammatical intricacies of the word? John Austin made this point in “A Plea for Excuses,” when he said, if we are using the analytic method, the method of analysis of language, in order to sharpen our perception of the phenomena, then “it is plainly preferable to investigate a field where ordinary language is rich and subtle, as it is in the pressingly practical matter of Excuses, but certainly is not in the matter, say, of Time.” Ordinary-language philosophers have studied time talk, what Wittgenstein called the “language game” of discourse about time. Wittgenstein’s expectation is that by drawing attention to ordinary ways of speaking we will be able to dissolve rather than answer our philosophical questions. But most philosophers of time are unsatisfied with this approach; they want the questions answered, not dissolved, although they are happy to have help from the ordinary language philosopher in clearing up misconceptions that may be produced by the way we use the word in our ordinary, non-technical discourse.

c. Linear and Circular Time

Is time more like a straight line or instead more like a circle? If your personal time were circular, then eventually you would be reborn. With circular time, the future is also in the past, and every event occurs before itself. If your time is like this, then the question arises as to whether you would be born an infinite number of times or only once. The argument that you'd be born only once appeals to Leibniz’s Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles: each supposedly repeating state of the world would occur just once because each state would not be discernible from the state that recurs. The way to support the idea of eternal recurrence or repeated occurrence seems to be to presuppose a linear ordering in some "hyper" time of all the cycles so that each cycle is discernible from its predecessor because it occurs at a different hyper time.

During history (and long before Einstein made a distinction between proper time and coordinate time), a variety of answers were given to the question of whether time is like a line or, instead, closed like a circle. The concept of linear time first appeared in the writings of the Hebrews and the Zoroastrian Iranians. The Roman writer Seneca also advocated linear time. Plato and most other Greeks and Romans believed time to be motion and believed cosmic motion was cyclical, but this was not envisioned as requiring any detailed endless repetition such as the multiple rebirths of Socrates. However, the Pythagoreans and some Stoic philosophers such as Chrysippus did adopt this drastic position. Circular time was promoted in Ecclesiastes 1:9: "That which has been is what will be, That which is done is what will be done, And there is nothing new under the sun." The idea was picked up again by Nietzsche in 1882. Scholars do not agree on whether Nietzsche meant his idea of circular time to be taken literally or merely for a moral lesson about how you should live your life if you knew that you'd live it over and over.

Many Islamic and Christian theologians adopted the ancient idea that time is linear. Nevertheless, it was not until 1602 that the concept of linear time was more clearly formulated—by the English philosopher Francis Bacon. In 1687, Newton advocated linear time when he represented time mathematically by using a continuous straight line with points being analogous to instants of time. The concept of linear time was promoted by Descartes, Spinoza, Hobbes, Barrow, Newton, Leibniz, Locke and Kant. Kant argued that it is a matter of necessity. In the early 19th century in Europe, the idea of linear time had become dominant in both science and philosophy.

There are many other mathematically possible topologies for time. Time could be linear or closed (circular). Linear time might have a beginning or have no beginning; it might have an ending or no ending. There could be two disconnected time streams, in two parallel worlds; perhaps one would be linear and the other circular. There could be branching time, in which time is like the letter "Y", and there could be a fusion time in which two different time streams are separate for some durations but merge into one for others. Time might be two dimensional instead of one dimensional. For all these topologies, there could be discrete time or, instead, continuous time. That is, the micro-structure of time's instants might be analogous to a sequence of integers or, instead, analogous to a continuum of real numbers. For physicists, if time were discrete or quantized, their favorite lower limit on a possible duration is the Planck time of about 10-43 seconds.

d. The Extent of Time

In ancient Greece, Plato and Aristotle agreed that the past is eternal. Aristotle claimed that time had no beginning because, for any time, we always can imagine an earlier time.  The reliability of appealing to our imagination to tell us how things are eventually waned. Although Aquinas agreed with Aristotle about the past being eternal, his contemporary St. Bonaventure did not. Martin Luther estimated the world to have begun in 4,000 B.C.E.; Johannes Kepler estimates it to have begun in 4,004 B.C.E; and the Calvinist James Ussher calculated that the world began on Friday, October 28, 4,004 B.C.E. Advances in the science of geology eventually refuted these small estimates for the age of the Earth, and advances in astronomy eventually refuted the idea that the Earth and the universe were created at about the same time.

Physicists generally agree that future time is infinite, but it is an open question whether past time is finite or infinite. Many physicists believe that past time is infinite, but many others believe instead that time began with the Big Bang about 13.8 billion years ago.

In the most well-accepted version of the Big Bang Theory in the field of astrophysics, about 13.8 billion years ago our universe had an almost infinitesimal size and an almost infinite temperature and gravitational field. The universe has been expanding and cooling ever since.

In the more popular version of the Big Bang theory, the Big Bang theory with inflation, the universe once was an extremely tiny bit of explosively inflating material. About 10-36 second later, this inflationary material underwent an accelerating expansion that lasted for 10-30 seconds during which the universe expanded by a factor of 1078. Once this brief period of inflation ended, the volume of the universe was the size of an orange, and the energy causing the inflation was transformed into a dense gas of expanding hot radiation. This expansion has never stopped. But with expansion came cooling, and this allowed individual material particles to condense and eventually much later to clump into stars and galaxies. The mutual gravitational force of the universe’s matter and energy decelerated the expansion, but seven billion years after our Big Bang, the universe’s dark energy became especially influential and started to accelerate the expansion again, despite the mutual gravitational force, although not at the explosive rate of the initial inflation. This more recent inflation of the universe will continue forever at an exponentially accelerating rate, as the remaining matter-energy becomes more and more diluted.

The Big Bang Theory with or without inflation is challenged by other theories such as a cyclic theory in which every trillion years the expansion changes to contraction until the universe becomes infinitesimal, at which time there is a bounce or new Big Bang. The cycles of Bang and Crunch continue forever, and they might or might not have existed forever. For the details, see (Steinhardt 2012). A promising but as yet untested theory called "eternal inflation" implies that our particular Big Bang is one among many other Big Bangs that occurred within a background spacetime that is actually infinite in space and in past time and future time.

Consider this challenging argument from (Newton-Smith 1980, p. 111) that claims time cannot have had a finite past: “As we have reasons for supposing that macroscopic events have causal origins, we have reason to suppose that some prior state of the universe led to the product of [the Big Bang]. So the prospects for ever being warranted in positing a beginning of time are dim.” The usual response to Newton-Smith here is two-fold. First, our Big Bang is a microscopic event, not a macroscopic event, so it might not be relevant that macroscopic events have causal origins. Second, and more importantly, if a confirmed cosmological theory implies there is a first event, we can say this event is an exception to any metaphysical principle that every event has a prior cause.

e. Does Time Emerge from Something More Basic?

Is time a fundamental feature of nature, or does it emerge from more basic timeless features–in analogy to the way the smoothness of water flow emerges from the complicated behavior of the underlying molecules, none of which is properly called "smooth"? That is, is time ontologically basic (fundamental), or does it depend on something even more basic?

We might rephrase this question more technically by asking whether facts about time supervene on more basic facts. Facts about sound supervene on, or are a product of, facts about changes in the molecules of the air, so molecular change is more basic than sound. Minkowski argued in 1908 that we should believe spacetime is more basic than time, and this argument is generally well accepted. However, is this spacetime itself basic? Some physicists argue that spacetime is the product of some more basic micro-substrate at the level of the Planck length, although there is no agreed-upon theory of what the substrate is, although a leading candidate is quantum information.

Other physicists say space is not basic, but time is. In 2004, after winning the Nobel Prize in physics, David Gross expressed this viewpoint:

Everyone in string theory is convinced…that spacetime is doomed. But we don’t know what it’s replaced by. We have an enormous amount of evidence that space is doomed. We even have examples, mathematically well-defined examples, where space is an emergent concept…. But in my opinion the tough problem that has not yet been faced up to at all is, “How do we imagine a dynamical theory of physics in which time is emergent?” …All the examples we have do not have an emergent time. They have emergent space but not time. It is very hard for me to imagine a formulation of physics without time as a primary concept because physics is typically thought of as predicting the future given the past. We have unitary time evolution. How could we have a theory of physics where we start with something in which time is never mentioned?

The discussion in this section about whether time is ontologically basic has no implications for whether the word “time” is semantically basic or whether the idea of time is basic to concept formation.

f. Time and Conventionality

It is an arbitrary convention that our civilization designs clocks to count up to higher numbers rather than down to lower numbers as time goes on. It is just a matter of convenience that we agree to the convention of re-setting our clock by one hour as we cross a time-zone. It is an arbitrary convention that there are twenty-four hours in a day instead of ten, that there are sixty seconds in a minute rather than twelve, that a second lasts as long as it does, and that the origin of our coordinate system for time is associated with the birth of Jesus on some calendars but the entry of Mohammed into Mecca on other calendars.

According to relativity theory, if two events couldn't have had a causal effect on each other, then we analysts are free to choose a reference frame in which one of the events happens first, or instead the other event happens first, or instead the two events are simultaneous. But once a frame is chosen, this fixes the time order of any pair of events. This point is discussed further in the next section.

In 1905, the French physicist Henri Poincaré argued that time is not a feature of reality to be discovered, but rather is something we've invented for our convenience. Because, he said, possible empirical tests cannot determine very much about time, he recommended the convention of adopting the concept of time that makes for the simplest laws of physics. Opposing this conventionalist picture of time, other philosophers of science have recommended a less idealistic view in which time is an objective feature of reality. These philosophers are recommending an objectivist picture of time.

Can our standard clock be inaccurate? Yes, say the objectivists about the standard clock. No, say the conventionalists who say that the standard clock is accurate by convention; if it acts strangely, then all clocks must act strangely in order to stay in synchrony with the standard clock that tells everyone the correct time. A closely related question is whether, when we change our standard clock, from being the Earth's rotation to being an atomic clock, or just our standard from one kind of atomic clock to another kind of atomic clock, are we merely adopting constitutive conventions for our convenience, or in some objective sense are we making a more correct choice?

Consider how we use a clock to measure how long an event lasts, its duration. We always use the following method: Take the time of the instant at which the event ends, and subtract the time of the instant when the event starts. To find how long an event lasts that starts at 3:00 and ends at 5:00, we subtract and get the answer of two hours. Is the use of this method merely a convention, or in some objective sense is it the only way that a clock should be used? The method of subtracting the start time from the end time is called the "metric" of time. Is there an objective metric, or is time "metrically amorphous," to use a phrase from Adolf Grünbaum, because there are alternatively acceptable metrics, such as subtracting the square roots of those times, or perhaps using the square root of their difference and calling this the "duration"?

There is an ongoing dispute about the extent to which there is an element of conventionality in Einstein’s notion of two separated events happening at the same time. Einstein said that to define simultaneity in a single reference frame you must adopt a convention about how fast light travels going one way as opposed to coming back (or going any other direction). He recommended adopting the convention that light travels the same speed in all directions (in a vacuum free of the influence of gravity). He claimed it must be a convention because there is no way to measure whether the speed is really the same in opposite directions since any measurement of the two speeds between two locations requires first having synchronized clocks at those two locations, yet the synchronization process will presuppose whether the speed is the same in both directions. The philosophers B. Ellis and P. Bowman in 1967 and D. Malament in 1977 gave different reasons why Einstein is mistaken. For an introduction to this dispute, see the Frequently Asked Questions. For more discussion, see (Callender and Hoefer 2002).

4. What Does Science Require of Time?

Physics, including astronomy, is the only science that explicitly studies time, although all sciences use the concept. Yet different physical theories place different demands on this concept. So, let's discuss time from the perspective of current science.

Physical theories treat time as being another dimension, analogous to a spatial dimension, and they describe an event as being located at temporal coordinate t, where t is a real number. Each specific temporal coordinate is called a "time." An instantaneous event is a moment and is located at just one time, or one temporal coordinate, say t1. It is said to last for an "instant." If the event is also a so-called "point event," then it is located at a single spatial coordinate, say <x1, y1, z1>. Locations constitute space, and times constitute time.

The fundamental laws of science do not pick out a present moment or present time. This fact is often surprising to a student who takes a science class and notices all sorts of talk about the present. Scientists frequently do apply some law of science while assigning, say, t0 to be the name of the present moment, then calculate this or that. This insertion of the fact that t0 is the present is an initial condition of the situation to which the law is being applied, and is not part of the law itself. The laws themselves treat all moments equally.

Science does not require that its theories have symmetry under time-translation, but this is a goal that physicists do pursue for their basic (fundamental) theories. If a theory has symmetry under time-translation, then the laws of the theories do not change. The law of gravitation in the 21st century is the same law that held one thousand centuries ago.

Physics also requires that almost all the basic laws of science to be time symmetric. This means that a law, if it is a basic law, must not distinguish between backward and forward time directions.

In physics we need to speak of one event happening pi seconds after another, and of one event happening the square root of three seconds after another. In ordinary discourse outside of science we would never need this kind of precision. The need for this precision has led to requiring time to be a linear continuum, very much like a segment of the real number line. So, one  requirement that relativity, quantum mechanics and the Big Bang theory place on any duration is that is be a continuum. This implies that time is not quantized, even in quantum mechanics. In a world with time being a continuum, we cannot speak of some event being caused by the state of the world at the immediately preceding instant because there is no immediately preceding instant, just as there is no real number immediately preceding pi.

EinsteinEinstein's theory of relativity has had the biggest impact on our understanding of time. But Einstein was not the first physicist to appreciate the relativity of motion. Galileo and Newton would have said speed is relative to reference frame. Einstein would agree but would add that durations and occurrence times are also relative. For example, any observer fixed to a moving railroad car in which you are seated will say your speed is zero, whereas an observer fixed to the train station will say you have a positive speed. But as Galileo and Newton understood relativity, both observers will agree about the time you had lunch on the train. Einstein would say they are making a mistake about your lunchtime; they should disagree about when you had lunch. For Newton, the speed of anything, including light, would be different in the two frames that move relative to each other, but Einstein said Maxwell’s equations require the speed of light to be invariant. This implies that the Galilean equations of motion are incorrect. Einstein figured out how to change the equations; the consequence is the Lorentz transformations in which two observers in relative motion will have to disagree also about the durations and occurrence times of events. What is happening here is that Einstein is requiring a mixing of space and time; Minkowski said it follows that there is a spacetime which divides into its space and time differently for different observers.

One consequence of this is that relativity's spacetime is more fundamental than either space or time alone. Spacetime is commonly said to be four-dimensional, but because time is not space it is more accurate to think of spacetime as being (3 + 1)-dimensional. Time is a distinguished, linear subspace of four-dimensional spacetime.

Time is relative in the sense that the duration of an event depends on the reference frame used in measuring the duration. Specifying that an event lasted three minutes without giving even an implicit indication of the reference frame is like asking someone to stand over there and not giving any indication of where “there” is. One implication of this is that it becomes more difficult to defend McTaggart's A-theory which says that properties of events such as "happened twenty-three minutes ago" and "is happening now" are basic properties of events and are not properties relative to chosen reference frames.

Another profound idea from relativity theory is that accurate clocks do not tick the same for everyone everywhere. Each object has its own proper time, and so the correct time shown by a clock depends on its history (in particular, it history of speed and gravitational influence).  Relative to clocks that are stationary in the reference frame, clocks in motion run slower, as do clocks in stronger gravitational fields. In general, two synchronized clocks do not stay synchronized if they move relative to each other or undergo different gravitational forces. Clocks in cars driving by your apartment building run slower than your apartment’s clock.

Suppose there are two twins. One stays on Earth while the other twin zooms away in a spaceship and returns ten years later according to the spaceship’s clock. That same arrival event could be twenty years later according to an Earth-based clock, provided the spaceship went fast enough. The Earth twin would now be ten years older than the spaceship twin. So, one could say that the Earth twin lived two seconds for every one second of the spaceship twin.

According to relativity theory, the order of events in time is only a partial order because for any event e, there is an event f such that e need not occur before f, simultaneous with f, nor after f.  These pairs of events are said to be in each others’ “absolute elsewhere,” which is another way of saying that neither could causally affect each other because even a light signal could not reach from one event to the other. Adding a coordinate system or reference frame to spacetime will force the events in all these pairs to have an order and so force the set of all events to be totally ordered in time, but what is interesting philosophically is that there is a leeway in the choice of the frame. For any two specific events e and f that could never causally affect each other, the analyst may choose a frame in which e occurs first, or choose another frame in which f occurs first, or instead choose another frame in which they are simultaneous. Any choice of frame will be correct. Such is the surprising nature of time according to relativity theory.

General relativity places other requirements on events that are not required in special relativity. Unlike in Newton's physics and the physics of special relativity, in general relativity the spacetime is not a passive container for events; it is dynamic in the sense that any change in the amount and distribution of matter-energy will change the curvature of spacetime itself. Gravity is a manifestation of the warping of spacetime. In special relativity, its Minkowski spacetime has no curvature. In general relativity a spacetime with no mass or energy might or might not have curvature, so the geometry of spacetime is not always determined by the behavior of matter and energy.

In 1611, Bishop James Ussher declared that the beginning of time occurred on October 23, 4004 B.C.E. Today's science disagrees. According to one interpretation of the Big Bang theory of cosmology, the universe began 13.8 billion years ago as spacetime started to expand from an infinitesimal volume; and the expansion continues today, with the volume of space now doubling in size about every ten billion years. The amount of future time  is a potential infinity (in Aristotle's sense of the term) as opposed to an actual infinity. For more discussion of all these compressed remarks, see What Science Requires of Time.

5. What Kinds of Time Travel are Possible?

Most scientists and philosophers of time agree that there is good evidence that human time travel has occurred. To explain, let’s first define the term. We mean physical time travel, not travel by wishing or dreaming or sitting still and letting time march on. In any case of physical time travel the traveler’s journey as judged by a correct clock attached to the traveler takes a different amount of time than the journey does as judged by a correct clock of someone who does not take the journey.

The physical possibility of human travel to the future is well accepted, but travel to the past is more controversial, and time travel that changes either the future or the past is generally considered to be impossible. Our understanding of time travel comes mostly from the implications of Einstein’s general theory of relativity. This theory has never failed any of its many experimental tests, so we trust its implications for human time travel.

Einstein’s general theory of relativity permits two kinds of future time travel—either by moving at high speed or by taking advantage of the presence of an intense gravitational field. Let's consider just the time travel due to high speed. Actually any motion produces time travel (relative to the clocks of those who do not travel), but if  you move at extremely high speed, the time travel is more noticeable; you can travel into the future to the year 2,300 on Earth (as measured by clocks fixed to the Earth) while your personal clock measures that merely, let’s say, ten years have elapsed. You can participate in that future, not just view it. You can meet your twin sister’s descendants. But you cannot get back to the twenty-first century on Earth by reversing your velocity. If you get back, it will be via some other way.

It's not that you suddenly jump into the Earth's future of the year 2,300. Instead you have continually been traveling forward in both your personal time and the Earth’s external time, and you could have been continuously observed from Earth’s telescopes during your voyage.

How about travel to the past, the more interesting kind of time travel? This is not allowed by either Newton's physics or Einstein's special relativity, but is allowed by general relativity. In 1949, Kurt Gödel surprised Albert Einstein by discovering that in some unusual worlds that obey the equations of general relativity—but not in the actual world—you can continually travel forward in your personal time but eventually arrive into your own past.

Unfortunately, say many philosophers and scientists, even if you can travel to the past in the actual world you cannot do anything that has not already been done, or else there would be a contradiction. In fact, if you do go back, you would already have been back there. For this reason, if you go back in time and try to kill your childhood self, you will fail no matter how hard you try. You can kill yourself, but you won’t because you didn’t. While attempting to kill yourself, you will be in two different bodies at the same time.

Here are a variety of philosophical arguments against past-directed time travel.

  1. If past time travel were possible, then you could be in two different bodies at the same time, which is ridiculous.
  2. If you were presently to go back in time, then your present events would cause past events, which violates our concept of causality.
  3. Time travel is impossible because, if it were possible, we should have seen many time travelers by now, but nobody has encountered any time travelers.
  4. If past time travel were possible, criminals could avoid their future arrest by traveling back in time, but that is absurd, so time travel is, too.
  5. If there were time travel, then when time travelers go back and attempt to change history, they must always botch their attempts to change anything, and it will appear to anyone watching them at the time as if Nature is conspiring against them. Since observers have never witnessed this apparent conspiracy of Nature, there is no time travel.
  6. Travel to the past is impossible because it allows the gaining of information for free. Here is a possible scenario. Buy a copy of Darwin's book The Origin of Species, which was published in 1859. In the 21st century, enter a time machine with it, go back to 1855 and give the book to Darwin himself. He could have used your copy in order to write his manuscript which he sent off to the publisher. If so, who first came up with the knowledge about evolution? Neither you nor Darwin. Because this scenario contradicts what we know about where knowledge comes from, past-directed time travel isn't really possible.
  7. The philosopher John Earman describes a rocket ship that carries a time machine capable of firing a probe (perhaps a smaller rocket) into its recent past. The ship is programmed to fire the probe at a certain time unless a safety switch is on at that time. Suppose the safety switch is programmed to be turned on if and only if the “return” or “impending arrival” of the probe is detected by a sensing device on the ship. Does the probe get launched? It seems to be launched if and only if it is not launched. However, the argument of Earman’s Paradox depends on the assumptions that the rocket ship does work as intended—that people are able to build the computer program, the probe, the safety switch, and an effective sensing device. Earman himself says all these premises are acceptable and so the only weak point in the reasoning to the paradoxical conclusion is the assumption that travel to the past is physically possible. There is an alternative solution to Earman’s Paradox. Nature conspires to prevent the design of the rocket ship just as it conspires to prevent anyone from building a gun that shoots if and only if it does not shoot. We cannot say what part of the gun is the obstacle, and we cannot say what part of Earman’s rocket ship is the obstacle.

These complaints about travel to the past are a mixture of arguments that past-directed time travel is not logically possible, that it is not physically possible, that it is not technologically possible with current technology, and that it is unlikely, given today's empirical evidence.

For more discussion of time travel, see the encyclopedia article “Time Travel.”

6. Does Time Require Change? (Relational vs. Substantival Theories)

By "time requires change," we mean that for time to exist something must change its properties over time. We don't mean, change it properties over space as in change color from top to bottom. There are two main philosophical theories about whether time requires change, relational theories and substantival theories.

In a relational theory of time, time is defined in terms of relationships among objects, in particular their changes. Substantival theories are theories that imply time is substance-like in that it exists independently of changes; it exists independently of all the spacetime relations exhibited by physical processes. This theory allows "empty time" in which nothing changes. On the other hand, relational theories do not allow this. They imply that at every time something is happening—such as an electron moving through space or a tree leaf changing its color. In short, no change implies no time. Some substantival theories describe spacetime as being like a container for events. The container exists with or without events in it. Relational theories imply there is no container without contents. But the substance that substantivalists have in mind is more like a medium pervading all of spacetime and less like an external container. The vast majority of relationists present their relational theories in terms of actually instantiated relations and not merely possible relations.

Everyone agrees time cannot be measured without there being changes, because we measure time by observing changes in some property or other, but the present issue is whether time exists without changes. On this issue, we need to be clear about what sense of change and what sense of property we are intending. For the relational theory, the term "property" is intended to exclude what Nelson Goodman called grue-like properties. Let us define an object to be grue if it is green before the beginning of the year 1888 but is blue thereafter. Then the world’s chlorophyll undergoes a change from grue to non-grue in 1888. We’d naturally react to this by saying that change in chlorophyll's grue property is not a “real change” in the world’s chlorophyll.

Does Queen Anne’s death change when I forget about it? Yes, but the debate here is whether the event’s intrinsic properties can change, not merely its non-intrinsic properties such as its relationships to us. This special intrinsic change is called by many names: secondary change and second-order change and McTaggartian change and McTaggart change. Second-order change is the kind of change that A-theorists say occurs when Queen Anne's death recedes ever farther into the past. The objection from the B-theorists here is that this is not a "real, objective, intrinsic change" in her death. First-order change is ordinary change, the kind that occurs when a leaf changes from green to brown, or a person changes from sitting to standing.

Einstein's general theory of relativity does imply it is possible for spacetime to exist while empty of events. This empty time is permissible according to the substantival theory but not allowed by the relational theory. Yet Einstein considered himself to be a relationalist.

Substantival theories are sometimes called "absolute theories." Unfortunately the term "absolute theory" is used in two other ways. A second sense of " to be absolute" is to be immutable,  or changeless. A third sense is to be independent of observer or reference frame. Although Einstein’s theory implies there is no absolute time in the sense of being independent of reference frame, it is an open question whether relativity theory undermines absolute time in the sense of substantival time; Einstein believed it did, but many philosophers of science do not.

The first advocate of a relational theory of time was Aristotle. He said, “neither does time exist without change.” (Physics, book IV, chapter 11, page 218b) However, the battle lines were most clearly drawn in the early 18th century when Leibniz argued for the relational position against Newton, who had adopted a substantival theory of time. Leibniz’s principal argument against Newton is a reductio ad absurdum. Suppose Newton’s space and time were to exist. But one could then imagine a universe just like ours except with everything shifted five kilometers east and five minutes earlier. However, there would be no reason why this shifted universe does not exist and ours does. Now we have arrived at a contradiction because, if there is no reason for there to be our universe rather than the shifted universe, then we have violated Leibniz’s Principle of Sufficient Reason: that there is an understandable reason for everything being the way it is. So, by reductio ad absurdum, Newton’s substantival space and time do not exist. In short, the trouble with Newton’s theory is that it leads to too many unnecessary possibilities.

Newton offered this two-part response: (1) Leibniz is correct to accept the Principle of Sufficient Reason regarding the rational intelligibility of the universe, but there do not have to be knowable reasons for humans; God might have had His own sufficient reason for creating the universe at a given place and time even though mere mortals cannot comprehend His reasons. (2) The bucket thought-experiment shows that acceleration relative to absolute space is detectable; thus absolute space is real, and if absolute space is real, so is absolute time. Here's how to detect absolute space. Suppose we tie a bucket’s handle to a rope hanging down from a tree branch. Partially fill the bucket with water, and let it come to equilibrium. Notice that there is no relative motion between the bucket and the water, and in this case the water surface is flat. Now spin the bucket, and keep doing this until the angular velocity of the water and the bucket are the same. In this second case there is again no relative motion between the bucket and the water, but now the water surface is concave. So spinning makes a difference, but how can a relational theory explain the difference in the shape of the surface? It cannot, says Newton. When the bucket and water are spinning, what are they spinning relative to? Because we can disregard the rest of the environment including the tree and rope, says Newton, the only explanation of the difference in surface shape between the non-spinning case and the spinning case is that when it is not spinning there is no motion relative to space, but when it is spinning there is motion relative to a third thing, space itself, and space itself is acting upon the water surface to make it concave. Alternatively expressed, the key idea is that the presence of centrifugal force is a sign of rotation relative to absolute space. Leibniz had no rebuttal. So, for over two centuries after this argument was created, Newton’s absolute theory of space and time was generally accepted by European scientists and philosophers.

One hundred years later, Kant entered the arena on the side of Newton. In a space containing only a single glove, said Kant, Leibniz could not account for its being a right-handed glove versus a left-handed glove because all the internal relationships would be the same in either case. However, we all know that there is a real difference between a right and a left glove, so this difference can only be due to the glove’s relationship to space itself. But if there is a “space itself,” then the absolute or substantival theory is better than the relational theory.

Newton’s theory of time was dominant in the 18th and 19th centuries, even though during those centuries Huygens, Berkeley, and Mach had entered the arena on the side of Leibniz. Mach argued that it must be the remaining matter in the universe, such as the "fixed" stars, which causes the water surface in the bucket to be concave, and that without these stars or other matter, a spinning bucket would have a flat surface. In the 20th century, Hans Reichenbach and the early Einstein declared the special theory of relativity to be a victory for the relational theory, in large part because a Newtonian absolute space would be undetectable. Special relativity, they also said, ruled out a space-filling ether, the leading candidate for substantival space, so the substantival theory was incorrect. And the response to Newton’s bucket argument is to note Newton’s error in not considering the environment. Einstein agreed with Mach that, if you hold the bucket still but spin the background stars  in the environment, then the water will creep up the side of the bucket and form a concave surface—so the bucket thought experiment does not require absolute space.

Although it was initially believed by Einstein and Reichenbach that relativity theory supported Mach regarding the bucket experiment and the absence of absolute space, this belief is controversial. Many philosophers argue that Reichenbach and the early Einstein have been overstating the amount of metaphysics that can be extracted from the physics.  There is substantival in the sense of independent of reference frame and substantival in the sense of independent of events. Isn't only the first sense ruled out when we reject a space-filling ether? The critics admit that general relativity does show that the curvature of spacetime is affected by the distribution of matter, so today it is no longer plausible for a substantivalist to assert that the “container” is independent of the behavior of the matter it contains. But, so they argue, general relativity does not rule out a more sophisticated substantival theory in which spacetime exists even if it is empty and in which two empty universes could differ in the curvature of their spacetime. For this reason, by the end of the 20th century, substantival theories had gained some ground.

In 1969, Sydney Shoemaker presented an argument attempting to establish the understandability of time existing without change, as Newton’s absolutism requires. Divide all space into three disjoint regions, called region 3, region 4, and region 5. In region 3, change ceases every third year for one year. People in regions 4 and 5 can verify this and then convince the people in region 3 of it after they come back to life at the end of their frozen year. Similarly, change ceases in region 4 every fourth year for a year; and change ceases in region 5 every fifth year. Every sixty years, that is, every 3 x 4 x 5 years, all three regions freeze simultaneously for a year. In year sixty-one, everyone comes back to life, time having marched on for a year with no change. Note that even if Shoemaker’s scenario successfully shows that the notion of empty time is understandable, it does not show that empty time actually exists. If we accept that empty time occasionally exists, then someone who claims the tick of the clock lasts one second could be challenged by a skeptic who says perhaps empty time periods occur randomly and this supposed one-second duration contains three changeless intervals each lasting one billion years, so the duration is really three billion and one second rather than one second. However, we usually prefer the simpler of two competing hypotheses.

Empty time isn't directly detectable by those who are frozen, but it may be indirectly detectable, perhaps in the manner described by Shoemaker or by signs in advance of the freeze:

Suppose that immediately prior to the beginning of a local freeze there is a period of "sluggishness" during which the inhabitants of the region find that it makes more than the usual amount of effort for them to move the limbs of their bodies, and we can suppose that the length of this period of sluggishness is found to be correlated with the length of the freeze. (Shoemaker 1969, p. 374)

Is the ending of the freeze causeless, or does something cause the freeze to end? Perhaps the empty time itself causes the freeze to end. Yet if a period of empty time, a period of "mere" passage of time, is somehow able to cause something, then, argues Ruth Barcan Marcus, it is not clear that empty time can be dismissed as not being genuine change. (Shoemaker 1969, p. 380)

7. Does Time Flow?

Time seems to flow or pass in the sense that future events become present events and then become past events, just like a runner who passes us by and then recedes farther and farther from us.  In 1938, the philosopher George Santayana offered this description of the flow of time: “The essence of nowness runs like fire along the fuse of time.” The converse image of time's flowing past us is our advancing through time. Time definitely seems to flow, but there is philosophical disagreement about whether it really does flow, or pass. Is the flow objectively real? The dispute is related to the dispute about whether McTaggart's A-series or B-series is more fundamental.

a. McTaggart's A-Series and B-Series

In 1908, the philosopher J. M. E. McTaggart proposed two ways of linearly ordering all events in time by placing them into a series according to the times at which they occur. But this ordering can be created in two ways, an A way and a B way. Consider two past events a and b, in which b is the most recent of the two. In McTaggart's B-series, event a happens before event b in the series because the time of occurrence of event a is less than the time of occurrence of event b. But when ordering the same events into McTaggart's A-series, event a happens before event b for a different reason—because event a is more in the past than event b. Both series produce exactly the same ordering of events. Here is a picture of the ordering. c is another event that happens after a and b.


There are many other events that are located within the series at event a's location, namely all events simultaneous with event a. If we were to consider an instant of time to be a set of simultaneous events, then instants of time are also linearly ordered into an A-series and a B-series. McTaggart himself believed the A-series is paradoxical [for reasons that will not be explored in this article], but McTaggart also believed the A-properties such as being past are essential to our current concept of time, so for this reason he believed our current concept of time is incoherent.

Let's suppose that event c occurs in our present after events a and b. The information that c occurs in the present is not contained within either the A-series or the B-series. However, the information that c is in the present is used to create the A-series; it is what tells us to place c to the right of b. That information is not used to create the B-series.

Metaphysicians dispute whether the A-theory or instead the B-theory is the correct theory of reality. The A-theory comprises two theses, each of which is contrary to the B-theory: (1) Time is constituted by an A-series in which any event's being in the past (or in the present or in the future) is an intrinsic, objective, monadic property of the event itself and not merely a subjective relation between the event and us who exist. (2) The second thesis of the A-theory is that events change. In 1908, McTaggart described the special way that events change:

Take any event—the death of Queen Anne, for example—and consider what change can take place in its characteristics. That it is a death, that it is the death of Anne Stuart, that it has such causes, that it has such effects—every characteristic of this sort never changes.... But in one respect it does change. It began by being a future event. It became every moment an event in the nearer future. At last it was present. Then it became past, and will always remain so, though every moment it becomes further and further past.

This special change is called secondary change and second-order change and also McTaggartian change.

The B-theory disagrees with both thesis (1) and thesis (2) of the A-theory. According to the B-theory, the B-series and not the A-series is fundamental; fundamental temporal properties are relational; McTaggartian change is not an objective change and so is not metaphysically basic or ultimately real. The B-theory implies that an event's property of occurring in the past (or occurring twenty-three minutes ago, or now, or in a future century) is merely a subjective relation between the event and us because, when analyzed, it will be seen to make reference to our own perspective on the world. Here is how it is subjective, according to the B-theory. Queen Anne's death has the property of occurring in the past because it occurs in our past as opposed to, say, Aristotle's past; and it occurs in our past rather than our present or our future because it occurs at a time that is less than the time of occurrence of some event that we (rather than Aristotle) would say is occurring.  The B-theory is committed to there being no objective distinction among past, present and future. Both the A-theory and B-theory agree, however, that it would be a mistake to say of some event that it happens on a certain date but then later it fails to happen on that date.

The B-theorists complain that thesis (1) of the A-theory implies that an event’s being in the present is an intrinsic property of that event, so it implies that there is an absolute, global present for all of us. The B-theorist points out that according to Einstein’s Special Theory of Relativity there is no global present. An event can be in the present for you and not in the present for me. An event can be present in a reference frame in which you are a fixed observer, but if you are moving relative to me, then that same event will not be present in a reference frame in which I am a fixed observer. So, being present is not a property of an event, as the A theory implies. According to relativity theory, what is a property of an event is being present in a chosen reference frame, and this implies that being present is relative to us who are making the choice of reference frame.

When discussing the A-theory and the B-theory, metaphysicians often speak of

    • A-series and B-series, of
    • A-theory and B-theory, of
    • A-facts and B-facts, of
    • A-terms and B-terms, of
    • A-properties and B-properties, of
    • A-predicates and B-predicates, of
    • A-statements and B-statements, and of the
    • A-camp and B-camp.

Here are some examples. Typical B-series terms are relational; they are relations between events: "earlier than," "happens twenty-three minutes after," and "simultaneous with." Typical A-theory terms are monadic, they are one-place qualities of events: "the near future," "twenty-three minutes ago," and "present." The B-theory terms represent distinctively B-properties; the A-theory terms represent distinctively A-properties. The B-fact that event a occurs before event b will always be a fact, but the A-fact that event a occurred about an hour ago soon won’t be a fact. Similarly the A-statement that event a occurred about an hour ago will, if true, soon become false. However, B-facts are not transitory, and B-statements have fixed truth values. For the B-theorist, the statement "Event a occurs an hour before b" will, if true, never become false. The A-theory usually says A-facts are the truthmakers of true A-statements and so A-facts are ontologically fundamental; the B-theorist appeals instead to B-facts, insofar as one accepts facts into one’s ontology, which is metaphysically controversial. According to the B-theory, when the A-theorist correctly says "It began snowing twenty-three minutes ago," what really makes it true isn't the A-fact that the event of the snow's beginning has twenty-three minutes of pastness; what makes it true is that the event of uttering the sentence occurs twenty-three minutes after the event of it beginning to snow. Notice that "occurs ... after" is a B-term. Those persons in the A-camp and B-camp recognize that in ordinary speech we are not careful to use one of the two kinds of terminology, but each camp believes that it can best explain the terminology of the other camp in its own terms.

b. Subjective Flow and Objective Flow

There are two primary theories about time’s flow: (A) the flow is objectively real. (B) the flow is a myth or else is merely subjective. Often theory A is called the dynamic theory or the A-theory while theory B  is called the static theory or B-theory.

The static theory implies that the flow is an illusion, the product of a faulty metaphor. The defense of the theory goes something like this. Time exists, things change, but time does not change by flowing. The present does not move. We all experience this flow, but only in the sense that we all frequently misinterpret our experience. There is some objective feature of our brains that causes us to believe we are experiencing a flow of time, such as the fact that we have different perceptions at different times and the fact that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences; but the flow itself is not objective. This kind of theory of time's flow is often characterized as a myth-of-passage theory. The myth-of-passage theory is more likely to be adopted by those who believe in McTaggart’s B-theory. One point offered in favor of the myth-of-passage theory is to ask about the rate at which time flows. It would be a rate of one second per second. But that is silly. One second divided by one second is the number one. That’s not a coherent rate. There are other arguments, but these won't be explored here.

Physicists sometimes speak of time flowing in another sense of the term "flow." This is the sense in which change is continuous rather than discrete. That is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers normally use when debating the objectivity of time's flow.

There is another uncontroversial sense of flow—when physicists say that time flows differently for the two twins in Einstein's twin paradox. All the physicists mean here is that time is different in different reference frames that are moving relative to each other; they need not be promoting the dynamic theory over the static theory.

Physicists sometimes carelessly speak of time flowing in yet another sense—when what they mean is that time has an arrow, a direction from the past to the future. But again this is not the sense of “flow” that philosophers use when speaking of the dynamic theory of time's flow.

There is no doubt that time seems to pass, so a B-theorist might say the flow is subjectively real but not objectively real. There surely is some objective feature of our brains, say the critics of the dynamic theories, that causes us to mistakenly believe we are experiencing a flow of time, such as the objective fact that we have different perceptions at different times and that anticipations of experiences always happen before memories of those experiences, but the flow itself is not objectively real.

According to the dynamic theories, the flow of time is objective, a feature of our mind-independent reality. A dynamic theory is closer to common sense, and has historically been the more popular theory among philosophers. It is more likely to be adopted by those who believe that McTaggart's A-series is a fundamental feature of time but his B-series is not.

One dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being future, to being present, to being past, and they also change in their degree of pastness and degree of presentness. This kind of change is often called McTaggart's second-order change to distinguish it from more ordinary, first-order change as when a leaf changes from a green state to a brown state. For the B-theorist the only proper kind of change is when different states of affairs obtain at different times.

A second dynamic theory implies that the flow is a matter of events changing from being indeterminate in the future to being determinate in the present and past. Time’s flow is really events becoming determinate, so these dynamic theorists speak of time’s flow as “temporal becoming.”

Opponents of these two dynamic theories complain that when events are said to change, the change is not a real change in the event’s essential, intrinsic properties, but only in the event’s relationship to the observer. For example, saying the death of Queen Anne is an event that changes from present to past is no more of an objectively real change in her death than saying her death changed from being approved of to being disapproved of. This extrinsic change in approval does not count as an objectively real change in her death, and neither does the so-called second-order change from present to past or from indeterminate to determinate. Attacking the notion of time’s flow in this manner, Adolf Grünbaum said: “Events simply are or occur…but they do not ‘advance’ into a pre-existing frame called ‘time.’ … An event does not move and neither do any of its relations.”

A third dynamic theory says time's flow is the coming into existence of facts, the actualization of new states of affairs; but, unlike the first two dynamic theories, there is no commitment to events changing. This is the theory of flow that is usually accepted by advocates of presentism.

A fourth dynamic theory suggests the flow is (or is reflected in) the change over time of truth values of declarative sentences. For example, suppose the sentence, “It is now raining,” was true during the rain yesterday but has changed to false on today’s sunny day. That's an indication that time flowed from yesterday to today, and these sorts of truth value changes are at the root of the flow. In response, critics suggest that the temporal indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” has no truth value because the reference of the word “now” is unspecified. If it cannot have a truth value, it cannot change its truth value. However, the sentence is related to a sentence that does have a truth value, the sentence with the temp0ral indexical replaced by the date that refers to a specific time and with the other indexicals replaced by names of whatever they refer to. Supposing it is now midnight here on April 1, 2007, and the speaker is in Sacramento, California, then the indexical sentence, “It is now raining,” is intimately related to the more complete or context-explicit sentence, “It is raining at midnight on April 1, 2007 in Sacramento, California.” Only these latter, non-indexical, non-context-dependent, complete sentences have truth values, and these truth values do not change with time so they do not underlie any flow of time. Fully-described events do not change their properties and so time does not flow because complete or "eternal" sentences do not change their truth values.

Among B-theorists, Hans Reichenbach has argued that the flow of time is produced by the collapse of the quantum mechanical wave function. Another dynamic theory is promoted by advocates of the B-theory who add to the block-universe  a flowing present which "spotlights" the block at a particular slice at any time. This is often called the moving spotlight view.

John Norton (Norton 2010) argues that time's flow is objective but so far is beyond the reach of our understanding. Tim Maudlin argues that the objective flow of time is fundamental and unanalyzable. He is happy to say “time does indeed pass at the rate of one hour per hour.” (Maudlin 2007, p. 112)

Regardless of how we analyze the metaphor of time’s flow, it flows in the direction of the future, the direction of the arrow of time, and we need to analyze this metaphor of time's arrow.

8. What are the Differences among the Past, Present, and Future?

a. Presentism, the Growing-Past, Eternalism and the Block-Universe

Have dinosaurs slipped out of existence? More generally, we are asking whether the past is part of reality. How about the future? Philosophers are divided on the question of the reality of the past, present, and future. (1): According to presentism, if something is real, then it is real now; all and only things that exist now are real. The presentist maintains that the past and the future are not real, so if a statement about the past is true, this must be because some present facts make it true. Heraclitus, Duns Scotus, A. N. Prior, and Ned Markosian are presentists. Presentists belong in the A-camp because presentism implies that being present is an intrinsic property of an event; it's a property that the event has independent of our being alive now.

(2): Advocates of a growing-past agree with the presents that the present is special ontologically, but they argue that, in addition to the present, the past is also real and is growing bigger all the time. C. D. Broad, Richard Jeffrey, and Michael Tooley have defended this view. They claim the past and present are real, but the future is not real. William James famously remarked that the future is so unreal that even God cannot anticipate it. It is not clear whether Aristotle accepted the growing-past theory or accepted a form of presentism; see (Putnam 1967), p. 244 for commentary.

(3): Proponents of eternalism oppose presentism and the growing-past theory. Bertrand Russell, J. J. C. Smart, W. V. O. Quine, Adolf Grünbaum, and Paul Horwich object to assigning special ontological status to the past, the present, or the future. Advocates of eternalism do not deny the reality of the events that we classify as being in our past, present or future, but they say there is no objective ontological difference among the past, the present, and the future, just as there is no objective ontological difference among here, there, and far. Yes, we thank goodness that the threat to our safety is there rather than here, and that it is past rather than present, but these differences are subjective, being dependent on our point of view. The classification of events into past, or present, or future is a subjective classification, not an objective one.

Presentism is one of the theories in the A‐camp because it presumes that being present is an objective property that events have.

Eternalism, on the other hand, is closely associated with the block-universe theory as is four-dimensionalism. Four-dimensionalism implies that the ontologically basic (that is, fundamental) objects in the universe are four-dimensional rather than three-dimensional. Here, time is treated as being somewhat like a fourth dimension of space, though strictly speaking time is not a dimension of space. On the block theory, time is like a very special extra dimension of space, as in a Minkowski diagram, and for this reason the block theory is said to promote the spatialization of time. If time has an infinite future or infinite past, or if space has an infinite extent, then the block is infinitely large along those dimensions.

The block-universe theory implies that reality is a single block of spacetime with its time slices (planes of simultaneous events) ordered by the happens-before relation. Four-dimensionalism adds that every object that lasts longer than an instant is in fact a four-dimensional object with an infinite number of time-slices or temporal parts. Adults are composed of their infancy time-slices, plus their childhood time-slices, plus their teenage time-slices, and so forth.

The block itself has no distinguished past, present, and future, but any chosen reference frame has its own past, present, and future. The future, by the way, is the actual future, not all possible futures. William James coined the term “block-universe.” The growing-past theory is also called the growing-block theory.

All three ontologies about the past, present, and future agree that we only ever experience the present. One of the major issues for presentism is how to ground true propositions about the past. What makes it true that U.S. President Abraham Lincoln was assassinated? Some presentists will say what makes it true are only features of the present way things are. The eternalist disagrees. When someone says truly that Abraham Lincoln was assassinated, the eternalist believes this is to say something true of an existing Abraham Lincoln who is also a non-present thing.

A second issue for the presentist is to account for causation, for the fact that April showers caused May flowers. When causes occur, their effects are not yet present. A survey of defenses of presentism can be found in (Markosian 2003), but opponents of presentism need to be careful not to beg the question.

The presentist and the advocate of the growing-past will usually unite in opposition to eternalism on three grounds: (i) The present is so much more vivid to a conscious being than are memories of past experiences and expectations of future experiences. (No one can stand outside time and compare the vividness of present experience with the vividness of future experience and past experience.) (ii)  Eternalism misses the special “open” and changeable character of the future. In the block-universe, which is the ontological theory promoted by most eternalists, there is only one future, so this implies the future exists already, but we know this determinsm and its denial of free will is incorrect. (iii) A present event "moves" in the sense that a moment later it is no longer present, having lost its property of presentness.

The counter from the defenders of eternalism and the block-universe is that, regarding (i), the now is significant but not objectively real. Regarding (ii) and the open future,  the block theory allows determinism and fatalism but does not require either one. Eventually there will be one future, regardless of whether that future is now open or closed, and that is what constitutes the future portion of the block. Finally, don't we all fear impending doom? But according to presentism and the growing-block theory, why should we have this fear if the doom is known not to exist? The best philosophy of time will not make our different attitudes toward future and past danger be so mysterious.

The advocates of the block-universe attack both presentism and the growing-past theory by claiming that only the block-universe can make sense of the special theory of relativity’s implication that, if persons A and B are separated but in relative motion, an event in person A’s present can be in person B’s future, yet this implies that advocates of presentism and the growing-past theories must suppose that this event is both real and unreal because it is real for A but not real for B. Surely that conclusion is unacceptable, claim the eternalists. Two key assumptions of the block theory here are, first, that relativity does provide an accurate account of the spatiotemporal relations among events, and, second, that if there is some frame of reference in which two events are simultaneous, then if one of the events is real, so is the other.

Opponents of the block-universe counter that block theory does not provide an accurate account of the way things are because the block theory considers the present to be subjective, and not part of objective reality, yet the present is known to be part of objective reality. If science doesn't use the concept of the present in its basic laws, then this is one of science's faults. For a review of the argument from relativity against presentism, and for criticisms of the block theory, see (Putnam 1967) and (Saunders 2002).

b. Is the Present, the Now, Objectively Real?

A calendar does not tell us which day is the present day. The calendar leaves out the "now." All philosophers agree that we would be missing some important information if we did not know what time it is now, but these philosophers disagree over just what sort of information this is. Proponents of the objectivity of the present are committed to claiming the universe would have a present even if there were no conscious beings. This claim is controversial. For example, in 1915, Bertrand Russell objected to giving the present any special ontological standing:

In a world in which there was no experience, there would be no past, present, or future, but there might well be earlier and later. (Russell 1915, p. 212)

The debate about whether the present is objectively real is intimately related to the metaphysical dispute between McTaggart's A-theory and B-theory. The B-theory implies that the present is either non-existent or else mind-dependent, whereas the A-theory does not. The principal argument for believing in the objectivity of the now is that the now is so vivid to everyone; the present stands out specially among all times. If science doesn't explain this vividness, then there is a defect within science. A second argument points out that there is so much agreement among people around us about what is happening now and what is not. So, isn't that a sign that the concept of the now is objective, not subjective, and existent rather than non-existent? A third argument for objectivity of the now is that when we examine ordinary language we find evidence that a belief in the now is ingrained in our language. Notice all the present-tensed terminology in the English language. It is unlikely that it would be so ingrained if it were not correct to believe it.

One criticism of the first argument, the argument from vividness, is that the now is vivid but so is the "here," yet we don't conclude from this that the here is somehow objective geographically. Why then assume that the vividness of the now points to it being objective temporally? A second criticism is that we cannot now step outside our present experience and compare its vividness with experience now of future time and past times. What is being compared when we speak of "vividness" is our present experience with our memories and expectations.

A third criticism of the first argument regarding vividness points out that there are empirical studies by cognitive psychologists and neuroscientists showing that our judgment about what is vividly happening now is plastic and can be affected by our expectations and by what other experiences we are having at the time. For example, we see and hear a woman speaking to us from across the room; then we construct an artificial now in which hearing her speak and seeing her speak happen at the same time, whereas the acoustic engineer tells us we are mistaken because the sound traveled much slower than the light.

According to McTaggart's A-camp, there is a global now shared by all of us. The B-camp disagrees and says this belief is a product of our falsely supposing that everything we see is happening now; we are not factoring in the finite speed of light. Proponents of the subjectivity of the present frequently claim that a proper analysis of time talk should treat the phrases "the present" and "now" as indexical terms which refer to the time at which the phrases are uttered or written by the speaker, so their relativity to us speakers shows the essential subjectivity of the present. The main positive argument for subjectivity, and against the A-camp, appeals to the relativity of simultaneity, a feature of Einstein's Special Theory of Relativity of 1905. The argument points out that in this theory there is a block of space-time in which past events are separated from future events by a plane or "time slice" of simultaneous, presently-occurring instantaneous events, but this time slice is different in different reference frames. For example, take a reference frame in which you and I are not moving relative to each other; then we will easily agree on what is happening now—that is, on the 'now' slice of spacetime—because our clocks tick at the same rate. Not so for someone moving relative to us. If that other person is far enough away from us (that any causal influence of Beethoven's death couldn't have reached that person) and is moving fast enough away from us, then that person might truly say that Beethoven's death is occurring now! Yet if that person were moving rapidly towards us, they might truly say that our future death is happening now. Because the present is frame relative, the A-camp proponent of an objective now must select a frame and thus one of these different planes of simultaneous events as being "what's really happening now," but surely any such choice is just arbitrary, or so Einstein would say. Therefore, if we aren't going to reject Einstein's interpretation of his theory of special relativity, then we should reject the objectivity of the now. Instead we should think of every event as having its own past and future, with its present being all events that are simultaneous with it. For further discussion of this issue see (Butterfield 1984).

There are interesting issues about the now even in theology. Norman Kretzmann has argued that if God is omniscient, then He knows what time it is, and so must always be changing. Therefore, there is an incompatibility between God's being omniscient and God's being immutable.

c. Persist, Endure, Perdure, and Four-Dimensionalism

Some objects last longer than others. They persist longer. But there is philosophical disagreement about how to understand persistence. Objects considered four-dimensionally are said to persist by perduring rather than enduring. Think of events and processes as being four-dimensional. The more familiar three-dimensional objects such as chairs and people are usually considered to exist wholly at a single time and are said to persist by enduring through time. Advocates of four-dimensionalism endorse perduring objects rather than enduring objects as the metaphysically basic entities. All events, processes and other physical objects are four-dimensional sub-blocks of the block-universe. The perduring object persists by being the sum or “fusion” of a series of its temporal parts (also called its temporal stages and temporal slices and time slices). For example, a middle-aged man can be considered to be a four-dimensional perduring object consisting of his childhood, his middle age and his future old age. These are three of his infinitely many temporal parts.

One argument against four-dimensionalism is that it allows an object to have too many temporal parts. Four-dimensionalism implies that, during every second in which an object exists, there are at least as many temporal parts of the object as there are sub-intervals of the mathematical line in the interval from zero to one. According to (Thomson 1983), this is too many parts for any object to have. Thomson also says that as the present moves along, present temporal parts move into the past and go out of existence while some future temporal parts "pop" into existence, and she complains that this popping in and out of existence is implausible. The four-dimensionalist can respond to these complaints by remarking that the present temporal parts do not go out of existence when they are no longer in the present; instead, they simply do not presently exist. Similarly dinosaurs have not popped out of existence; they simply do not exist presently.

According to David Lewis in On the Plurality of Worlds, the primary argument for perdurantism is that it has an easy time of solving what he calls the problem of temporary intrinsics, of which the Heraclitus paradox is one example. The Heraclitus Paradox is the problem, first introduced by Heraclitus, of explaining our not being able to step into the same river twice because the water is different the second time. The mereological essentialist agrees with Heraclitus, but our common sense says Heraclitus is mistaken. The advocate of endurance has trouble showing that Heraclitus is mistaken for the following reason:  We do not step into two different rivers, do we? Yet the river has two different intrinsic properties, namely being two different collections of water; but, by Leibniz’s Law of the Indiscernibility of Identicals, identical objects cannot have different properties. A 4-dimensionalist who advocates perdurance says the proper metaphysical analysis of the Heraclitus paradox is that we can step into the same river twice by stepping into two different temporal parts of the same 4-d river. Similarly, we cannot see a football game at a moment; we can see only a momentary temporal part of the 4-d game. For more discussion of this topic in metaphysics, see (Carroll and Markosian 2010, pp. 173-7).

Eternalism differs from 4-dimensionalism. Eternalism says the present, past, and future are equally real, whereas 4-dimensionalism says the basic objects are 4-dimensional. Most 4-dimensionalists accept eternalism and four-dimensionalism and McTaggart's B-theory.

One of A. N. Prior’s criticisms of the B-theory involves the reasonableness of our saying of some painful, past event, “Thank goodness that is over.” Prior says the B-theorist cannot explain this reasonableness because no B-theorist should thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance of "Thank goodness that is over," since that B-fact or B-relationship is timeless or tenseless; it has always held and always will. The only way then to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness. But if so, then the A-theory is correct and the B-theory is incorrect.

One B-theorist response is discussed in a later section, but another response is simply to disagree with Prior that it is improper for a B-theorist to thank goodness that the end of their pain happens before their present utterance, even though this is an eternal B-fact. Still another response from the B-theorist comes from the 4-dimensionalist who says that as 4-dimensional beings it is proper for us to care more about our later time-slices than our earlier time-slices. If so, then it is reasonable to thank goodness that the time slice at the end of the pain occurs before the time slice that is saying, "Thank goodness that is over." Admittedly this is caring about an eternal B-fact. So Prior’s premise [that the only way to make sense of our saying “Thank goodness that is over” is to assume we are thankful for the A-fact that the pain event has pastness] is a faulty premise, and Prior’s argument for the A-theory is invalid.

Four-dimensionalism has implications for the philosophical problem of personal identity. According to four-dimensionalism, you as a teenager and you as a child are not the same person but rather are two different parts of one 4-dimensional person.

d. Truth Values and Free Will

The philosophical dispute about presentism, the growing-past theory, and the block theory or eternalism has taken a linguistic turn by focusing upon a question about language: “Are predictions true or false at the time they are uttered?” Those who believe in the block-universe (and thus in the determinate reality of the future) will answer “Yes” while a “No” will be given by presentists and advocates of the growing-past. The issue is whether contingent sentences uttered now about future events are true or false now rather than true or false only in the future at the time the predicted event is supposed to occur.

Suppose someone says, “Tomorrow the admiral will start a sea battle.” And suppose that tomorrow the admiral orders a sneak attack on the enemy ships which starts a sea battle. Advocates of the block-universe argue that, if so, then the above quoted sentence was true at the time it was uttered. Truth is eternal or fixed, they say, and “is true” is a tenseless predicate, not one that merely says “is true now.” These philosophers point favorably to the ancient Greek philosopher Chrysippus who was convinced that a contingent sentence about the future is true or false. If so, the sentence cannot have any other value such as “indeterminate” or "neither true or false now." Many other philosophers, usually in McTaggart's B-camp, agree with Aristotle's suggestion that the sentence is not true until it can be known to be true, namely at the time at which the sea battle occurs. The sentence was not true before the battle occurred. In other words, predictions have no (classical) truth values at the time they are uttered. Predictions fall into the “truth value gap.” This position that contingent sentences have no classical truth values is called the Aristotelian position because many researchers throughout history have taken Aristotle to be holding the position in chapter 9 of On Interpretation—although today it is not so clear that Aristotle himself held the position.

The principal motive for adopting the Aristotelian position arises from the belief that if sentences about future human actions are now true, then humans are determined to perform those actions, and so humans have no free will. To defend free will, we must deny truth values to predictions.

This Aristotelian argument against predictions being true or false has been discussed as much as any in the history of philosophy, and it faces a series of challenges. First, if there really is no free will, or if free will is compatible with determinism, then the motivation to deny truth values to predictions is undermined.

Second, according to the compatibilist, your choices affect the world, and if it is true that you will perform an action in the future, it does not follow that now you will not perform it freely, nor that you are not free to do otherwise if your intentions are different, but only that you will not do otherwise. For more on this point about modal logic, see Foreknowledge and Free Will.

A third challenge, from Quine and others, claims the Aristotelian position wreaks havoc with the logical system we use to reason and argue with predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument:

There will be a sea battle tomorrow.

If there will be a sea battle tomorrow, then we should wake up the admiral.

So, we should wake up the admiral.

Without the premises in this argument having truth values, that is, being true or false, we cannot properly assess the argument using the usual standards of deductive validity because this standard is about the relationships among truth values of the component sentences—that a valid argument is one in which it is impossible for the premises to be true and the conclusion to be false. Unfortunately, the Aristotelian position says that some of these component sentences are neither true nor false, so Aristotle’s position is implausible.

In reaction to this third challenge, proponents of the Aristotelian argument say that if Quine would embrace tensed propositions and expand his classical logic to a tense logic, he could avoid those difficulties in assessing the validity of arguments that involve sentences having future tense.

Quine has claimed that the analysts of our talk involving time should in principle be able to eliminate the temporal indexical words such as "now" and "tomorrow" because their removal is needed for fixed truth and falsity of our sentences [fixed in the sense of being eternal sentences whose truth values are not relative to the situation because the indexicals and indicator words have been replaced by times, places and names, and whose verbs are treated as tenseless], and having fixed truth values is crucial for the logical system used to clarify science. “To formulate logical laws in such a way as not to depend thus upon the assumption of fixed truth and falsity would be decidedly awkward and complicated, and wholly unrewarding,” says Quine.

Philosophers are still divided on the issues of whether only the present is real, what sort of deductive logic to use for reasoning about time, and whether future contingent sentences have truth values.

9. Are There Essentially-Tensed Facts?

Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way of locating an event in time. All the world’s cultures have a conception of time, but in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. For example, the Chinese, Burmese and Malay languages do not have any tenses. The English language expresses conceptions of time with tensed verbs but also in other ways, such as with the adverbial time phrases “now” and “twenty-three days ago,” and with the adjective phrases "brand-new" and "ancient," and with the prepositions "until" and "since." Philosophers have asked what we are basically committed to when we use tense to locate an event in the past, in the present, or in the future.

There are two principal answers or theories. One is that tense distinctions represent objective features of reality that are not captured by eternalism and the block-universe approach.  This theory is said to "take tense seriously" and is called the tensed theory of time, or the A-theory. This theory claims that when we learn the truth values of certain tensed sentences we obtain knowledge that tenseless sentences do not provide, for example, that such and such a time is the present time. Perhaps the tenseless theory rather than the tensed theory can be more useful for explaining human behavior than a tensed theory. Tenses are the same as positions in McTaggart's A-series, so the tensed theory is commonly associated with the A-camp that was discussed earlier in this article.

A second, contrary answer to the question of the significance of tenses is that tenses are merely subjective features of the perspective from which the speaking subject views the universe.  Using a tensed verb is a grammatical way, not of locating an event in the A-series, but rather of locating the event in time relative to the time that the verb is uttered or written. Actually this philosophical disagreement is not just about tenses in the grammatical sense. It is primarily about the significance of the distinctions of past, present, and future which those tenses are used to mark. The main metaphysical disagreement is about whether times and events have non-relational properties of pastness, presentness, and futurity. Does an event have or not have the property of, say, pastness independent of the event's relation to us and our temporal location?

On the tenseless theory of time, or the B-theory, whether the death of U. S. Lieutenant Colonel George Armstrong Custer occurred here depends on the speaker’s relation to the death event (Is the speaker standing at the battle site in Montana?); similarly, whether the death occurs now is equally subjective (Is it now 1876 for the speaker?). The proponent of the tenseless view does not deny the importance or coherence of talk about the past, but will say it should be analyzed in terms of talk about the speaker's relation to events. My assertion that the event of Custer's death occurred in the past might be analyzed by the B-theorist as asserting that Custer's death event happens before the event of my writing this sentence. This latter assertion does not explicitly use the past tense. According to the classical B-theorist, the use of tense is an extraneous and eliminable feature of language, as is all use of the terminology of the A-series.

This controversy is often presented as a dispute about whether tensed facts exist, with advocates of the tenseless theory objecting to tensed facts and advocates of the tensed theory promoting them as essential. The primary function of tensed facts is to make tensed sentences true. For the purposes of explaining this dispute, let us uncritically accept the Correspondence Theory of Truth and apply it to the following sentence:

Custer died in Montana.

If we apply the Correspondence Theory directly to this sentence, then the tensed theory or A-theory implies

The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tensed fact that Custer died in Montana.

The old tenseless theory or B-theory, created by Bertrand Russell (1915), would give a different analysis without tensed facts. It would say that the Correspondence Theory should be applied only to the result of first analyzing away tensed sentences into equivalent sentences that do not use tenses. Proponents of this classical tenseless theory prefer to analyze our sentence “Custer died in Montana” as having the same meaning as the following “eternal” sentence:

There is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of the writing of the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

In this analysis, the verb dies is logically tenseless (although grammatically it is in the present tense just like the "is" in "7 plus 5 is 12"). Applying the Correspondence Theory to this new sentence then yields:

The sentence “Custer died in Montana” is true because it corresponds to the tenseless fact that there is a time t such that Custer dies in Montana at time t, and time t is before the time of your reading the sentence “Custer died in Montana” by B. Dowden in the article “Time” in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

This Russell-like analysis is less straight-forward than the analysis offered by the tensed theory, but it does not use tensed facts.

This B-theory analysis is challenged by proponents of the tensed A-theory on the grounds that it can succeed only for utterances or readings or inscriptions, but a sentence can be true even if never read or inscribed. There are other challenges. Roderick Chisholm and A. N. Prior claim that the word “is” in the sentence “It is now midnight” is essentially present tensed because there is no adequate translation using only tenseless verbs. Trying to analyze it as, say, “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is to miss the essential reference to the present in the original sentence because the original sentence is not always true, but the sentence “There is a time t such that t = midnight” is always true. So, the tenseless analysis fails. There is no escape from this criticism by adding “and t is now” because this last indexical still needs analysis, and we are starting a vicious regress.

(Prior 1959) supported the tensed A-theory by arguing that after experiencing a painful event,

one says, e.g., “Thank goodness that’s over,” and [this]…says something which it is impossible that any use of a tenseless copula with a date should convey. It certainly doesn’t mean the same as, e.g., “Thank goodness the date of the conclusion of that thing is Friday, June 15, 1954,” even if it be said then. (Nor, for that matter, does it mean “Thank goodness the conclusion of that thing is contemporaneous with this utterance.” Why should anyone thank goodness for that?).

D.  H. Mellor and J. J. C. Smart agree that tensed talk is important for understanding how we think and speak—the temporal indexicals are essential, as are other indexicals—but they claim it is not important for describing temporal, extra-linguistic reality. They advocate a newer tenseless B-theory by saying the truth conditions of any tensed declarative sentence can be explained without tensed facts even if Chisholm and Prior are correct that some tensed sentences in English cannot be translated into tenseless ones. [The truth conditions of a sentence are the conditions which must be satisfied in the world in order for the sentence to be true.  The sentence "Snow is white" is true on the condition that snow is white. More particularly, it is true if whatever is referred to by the term 'snow' satisfies the predicate 'is white'. The conditions under which the conditional sentence "If it's snowing, then it's cold" are true are that it is not both true that it is snowing and false that it is cold. Other analyses are offered for the truth conditions of sentences that are more complex grammatically.]

According to the newer B-theory of Mellor and Smart, if I am speaking to you and say, "It is now midnight," then this sentence admittedly cannot be translated into tenseless terminology without loss of meaning, but the truth conditions can be explained with tenseless terminology. The truth conditions of "It is now midnight" are that my utterance occurs at the same time as your hearing the utterance, which in turn is the same time as when our standard clock declares the time to be midnight in our reference frame. In brief, it's true just in case it is uttered at midnight. Notice that no tensed facts are appealed to in the explanation of those truth conditions. Similarly, an advocate of the new tenseless theory could say it is not the pastness of the painful event that explains why I say, “Thank goodness that’s over.” I say it because I believe that the time of the occurrence of that utterance is greater than the time of the occurrence of the painful event, and because I am glad about this. Of course I'd be even gladder if there were no pain at any time. I may not be consciously thinking about the time of the utterance when I make it; nevertheless that time is what helps explain what I am glad about. Notice that appeal to tensed terminology was removed in that explanation.

In addition, it is claimed by Mellor and other new B-theorists that tenseless sentences can be used to explain the logical relations between tensed sentences: that one tensed sentence implies another, is inconsistent with yet another, and so forth. Understanding a declarative sentence's truth conditions and its truth implications and how it behaves in a network of inferences is what we understand whenever we know the meaning of the sentence. According to this new theory of tenseless time, once it is established that tensed sentences can be explained without utilizing tensed facts, then Ockham’s Razor is applied. If we can do without essentially-tensed facts, then we should say essentially-tensed facts do not exist. To summarize, tensed facts were presumed to be needed to account for the truth of tensed talk; but the new B-theory analysis shows that ordinary tenseless facts are adequate. The theory concludes that we should not take seriously metaphysical tenses with their tensed facts because they are not needed for describing the objective features of the extra-linguistic world. Proponents of the tensed theory of time do not agree with this conclusion. So, the philosophical debate continues over whether tensed concepts have semantical priority over untensed concepts, and whether tensed facts have ontological priority over untensed facts.

10. What Gives Time Its Direction or Arrow?

Time's arrow is revealed in the way macroscopic or multi-particle processes tend to go over time, and that way is the direction toward disarray, the direction toward equilibrium, the direction toward higher entropy. For example, egg processes always go from unbroken eggs to omelets, never in the direction from omelets to unbroken eggs. The process of mixing coffee always goes from black coffee and cream toward brown coffee. You can’t unmix brown coffee. We can ring a bell but never un-ring it.

The arrow of a physical process is the way it normally goes, the way it normally unfolds through time. If a process goes only one-way, we call it an irreversible process; otherwise it is reversible. (Strictly speaking, a reversible process is one that is reversed by an infinitesimal change of its surrounding conditions, but we can overlook this fine point because of the general level of the present discussion.) The amalgamation of the universe’s irreversible processes produces the cosmic arrow of time, the master arrow. This arrow of time is the same for all of us. Usually this arrow is what is meant when one speaks of time’s arrow. So, time's arrow indicates directed processes in time, and the arrow may or may not have anything to do with the flow of time.

Because so many of the physical processes that we commonly observe do have an arrow, you might think that an inspection of the basic micro-physical laws would readily reveal time’s arrow. It will not. With some exceptions, such as the collapse of the quantum mechanical wave function and the decay of a B meson, all the basic laws of fundamental processes are time symmetric. A process that is time symmetric can go forward or backward in time; the laws allow both. Maxwell’s equations of electromagnetism, for example, can be used to predict that television signals can exist, but these equations do not tell us whether those signals arrive before or arrive after they are transmitted. In other words, the basic laws of science, its fundamental laws, do not by themselves imply an arrow of time. Something else must tell us why television signals are emitted from, but not absorbed into, TV antennas and why omelets don't turn into whole, unbroken eggs. The existence of the arrow of time is not derivable from the basic laws of science but is due to entropy, to the fact that entropy goes from low to high and not the other way.  But, as we will see in a moment, it is not clear why entropy behaves this way. So, how to explain the arrow is still an open question in science and philosophy.

a. Time without an Arrow

Time could exist in a universe that had no arrow, provided there was change in the universe. However, that change needs to be random change in which processes happen one way sometimes and the reverse way at other times. The second law of thermodynamics would fail in such a universe.

b. What Needs to be Explained

There are many goals for a fully developed theory of time’s arrow. It should tell us (1) why time has an arrow; (2) why the basic laws of science do not reveal the arrow, (3) how the arrow is connected with entropy, (4) why the arrow is apparent in macro processes but not micro processes; (5) why the entropy of a closed system increases in the future rather than decreases even though the decrease is physically possible given current basic laws; (6) what it would be like for our arrow of time to reverse direction; (7) what are the characteristics of a physical theory that would pick out a preferred direction in time; (8) what the relationships are among the various more specific arrows of time—the various kinds of temporally asymmetric processes such as a B meson decay [the B-meson arrow], the collapse of the wave function [the quantum mechanical arrow], entropy increases [the thermodynamic arrow], causes preceding their effects [the causal arrow], light radiating away from hot objects rather than converging into them [the electromagnetic arrow], and our knowing the past more easily than the future [the knowledge arrow].

c. Explanations or Theories of the Arrow

There are three principal explanations of the arrow: (i) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to the initial conditions of the universe, (ii) it is a product of one-way entropy flow which in turn is due to some as yet unknown asymmetrical laws of nature, (iii) it is a product of causation which itself is asymmetrical.

Leibniz first proposed (iii), the so-called causal theory of time's order. Hans Reichenbach developed the idea in detail in 1928. He suggested that event A happens before event B if A could have caused B but B could not have caused A. The usefulness of this causal theory depends on a clarification of the notorious notions of causality and possibility without producing a circular explanation that presupposes an understanding of time order.

21st century physicists generally favor explanation (i). They say the most likely explanation of the emergence of an arrow of time in a world with time-blind basic laws is that the arrow is a product of the direction of entropy change. A leading suggestion is that this directedness of entropy change is due to increasing quantum entanglement plus the low-entropy state of the universe at the time of our Big Bang. Unfortunately there is no known explanation of why the entropy was so low at the time of our Big Bang. Some say the initially low entropy is just a brute fact with no more fundamental explanation. Others say it is due to as yet undiscovered basic laws that are time-asymmetric. And still others say it must be the product of the way the universe was before our Big Bang.

Before saying more about quantum entanglement let's describe entropy. There are many useful definitions of entropy. On one definition, it is a measure inversely related to the energy available for work in a physical system. According to another definition, the entropy of a physical system that is isolated from external influences is a measure [specifically, the logarithm] of how many microstates are macroscopically indistinguishable.  Less formally, entropy is a measure of how disordered or "messy" or "run down" a closed system is. More entropy implies more disorganization. Changes toward disorganization are so much more frequent than changes toward more organization because there are so many more ways for a closed system to be disorganized than for it to be organized. For example, there are so many more ways for the air molecules in an otherwise empty room to be scattered about evenly throughout the room giving it a uniform air density than there are ways for there to be a concentration of air within a sphere near the floor while the rest of the room is a vacuum. According to the 2nd Law of Thermodynamics, which is not one of our basic or fundamental laws of science, entropy in an isolated system or region never decreases in the future and almost always increases toward a state of equilibrium. Although Sadi Carnot discovered a version of the second law in 1824, Rudolf Clausius invented the concept of entropy and expressed the law in terms of heat. However, Ludwig Boltzmann generalized this work, expressed the law in terms of a more sophisticated concept of entropy involving atoms and their arrangements, and also tried to explain the law statistically as being due to the fact that there are so many more ways for a system of atoms to have arrangements with high entropy than arrangements with low entropy. This is why entropy flows from low to high naturally.

For example, if you float ice cubes in hot coffee, why do you end up with lukewarm coffee if you don’t interfere with this coffee-ice-cube system? And why doesn’t lukewarm coffee ever spontaneously turn into hot coffee with ice cubes? The answer from Boltzmann is that the number of macroscopically indistinguishable arrangements of the atoms in the system that appear to us as lukewarm coffee is so very much greater than the number of macroscopically indistinguishable arrangements of the atoms in the system that appear to us as ice cubes floating in the hot coffee. It is all about probabilities of arrangements of the atoms.

“What’s really going on [with the arrow of time pointing in the direction of equilibrium] is things are becoming more correlated with each other,” M.I.T. professor Seth Lloyd said. He was the first person to suggest that the arrow of time in any process is an arrow of increasing correlations as the particles in that process become more entangled with neighboring particles.

Said more simply and without mentioning entanglement, the change in entropy of a system that is not yet in equilibrium is a one-way street toward greater disorganization and less useful forms of energy. For example, when a car burns gasoline, the entropy increase is evident in the fact that the new heat energy distributed throughout the byproducts of  the gasoline combustion is much less useful than was the potential chemical energy in the pre-combustion gasoline. The entropy of our universe, conceived of as the largest isolated system, has been increasing for the last 13.8 billion years and will continue to do so for a very long time. At the time of the Big Bang, our universe was in a highly organized, low-entropy, non-equilibrium state, and it has been running down and getting more disorganized ever since. This running down is the cosmic arrow of time.

According to the 2nd Law of Thermodynamics, if an isolated system is not in equilibrium and has a great many particles, then it is overwhelmingly likely that the system's entropy will increase in the future. This 2nd law is universal but not fundamental because it apparently can be explained in terms of the behavior of the atoms making up the system. Ludwig Boltzmann was the first person to claim to have deduced the macroscopic 2nd law from reversible microscopic laws of Newtonian physics. Yet it seems too odd, said Joseph Loschmidt, that a one-way macroscopic process can be deduced from two-way microscopic processes. In 1876, Loschmidt argued that if you look at our present state (the black dot in the diagram below), then you ought to deduce from the basic laws (assuming you have no knowledge that the universe actually had lower entropy in the past) that it evolved not from a state of low entropy in the past, but from a state of higher entropy in the past, which of course is not at all what we know our past to be like. The difficulty is displayed in the diagram below.

graph of entropy vs. time

Yet we know our universe is an isolated system by definition, and we have good observational evidence that it surely did not have high entropy in the past—at least not in the past that is between now and the Big Bang—so the actual low value of entropy in the past is puzzling. Sean Carroll (2010) offers a simple illustration of the puzzle. If you found a half-melted ice cube in an isolated glass of water (analogous to the black dot in the diagram), and all you otherwise knew about the universe is that it obeys our current, basic time-reversible laws and you knew nothing about its low entropy past, then you'd infer, not surprisingly, that the ice cube would melt into a liquid in the future (solid green line). But, more surprisingly, you also would infer that your glass evolved from a state of  liquid water (dashed red line). You would not infer that the present half-melted state evolved from a state where the glass had a solid ice cube in it (dashed green line). To infer the solid cube you would need to appeal to your empirical experience of how processes are working around you, but you'd not infer the solid cube if all you had to work with were the basic time-reversible laws. To solve this so-called Loschmidt Paradox for the cosmos as a whole, and to predict the dashed green line rather than the dashed red line, physicists have suggested it is necessary to adopt the Past Hypothesis—that the universe at the time of the Big Bang was in a state of very low entropy. Using this Past Hypothesis, the most probable history of the universe over the last 13.8 billion years is one in which entropy increases.

Can the Past Hypothesis be justified from other principles? Some physicists (for example, Richard Feynman) and philosophers (for example, Craig Callender) say the initial low entropy may simply be a brute fact—that is, there is no causal explanation for the initial low entropy. Objecting to inexplicable initial facts as being unacceptably ad hoc, the physicists Walther Ritz and Roger Penrose say we need to keep looking for basic, time-asymmetrical laws that will account for the initial low entropy and thus for time’s arrow. A third perspective on the Past Hypothesis is that perhaps a future theory of quantum gravity will provide a justification of the Hypothesis. A fourth perspective appeals to God's having designed the Big Bang to start with low entropy. A fifth perspective appeals to the anthropic principle and the many-worlds interpretation of quantum mechanics in order to argue that since there exist so many universes with different initial entropies, there had to be one universe like our particular universe with its initial low entropy—and that is the only reason why our universe had low entropy initially.

d. Multiple Arrows

The past and future are different in many ways that reflect the arrow of time. Consider the difference between time’s arrow and time’s arrows. The direction of entropy change is the thermodynamic arrow. Here are some suggestions for additional arrows:

  1. We remember last week, not next week.
  2. There is evidence of the past but not of the future.
  3. Our present actions affect the future and not the past.
  4. It is easier to know the past than to know the future.
  5. Radio waves spread out from the antenna, but never converge into it.
  6. The universe expands in volume rather than shrinks.
  7. Causes precede their effects.
  8. We see black holes but never white holes.
  9. B meson decay, neutral kaon decay, and Higgs boson decay are each different in a time reversed world.
  10. Quantum mechanical measurement collapses the wave function.
  11. Possibilities decrease as time goes on.

Most physicists suspect all these arrows are linked so that we cannot have some arrows reversing while others do not. For example, the collapse of the wave function is generally considered to be due to an increase in the entropy of the universe. It is well accepted that entropy increase can account for the fact that we remember the past but not the future, that effects follow causes rather than precede them, and that animals grow old and never young. However, whether all the arrows are linked is still an open question.

e. Reversing the Arrow

Could the cosmic arrow of time have gone the other way? Most physicists suspect that the answer is yes, and they say it could have gone the other way if the initial conditions of the universe at our Big Bang had been different. Crudely put, if all the particles’ trajectories and charges are reversed, then the arrow of time would reverse. Here is a scenario of how it might happen. As our universe evolves closer to a point of equilibrium and very high entropy, time would lose its unidirectionality. Eventually, though, the universe could evolve away from equilibrium and perhaps it would evolve so that the directional processes we are presently familiar with would go in reverse. For example, we would get eggs from omelets very easily, but it would be too difficult to get omelets from eggs. Fires would absorb light instead of emit light. This new era would be an era of reversed time, and there would be a vaguely defined period of non-directional time separating the two eras.

If the cosmic arrow of time were to reverse this way, perhaps our past would be re-created and lived in reverse order. This re-occurrence of the past is different than the re-living of past events via time travel. With time travel the past is re-visited in the original order, not in reverse order.

Philosophers have asked interesting questions about the reversal of time’s arrow. What does it really mean to say time reverses? Does it require entropy to decrease on average in closed systems? If time were to reverse only in some far off corner of the universe, but not in our region of the universe, would dead people there become undead, and would the people there walk backwards up steps while remembering the future? First off, would it even be possible for them to be conscious? Assuming consciousness is caused by brain processes, could there be consciousness if their nerve pulses reversed, or would this reversal destroy consciousness? Supposing the answer is that they would be conscious, would people in that far off corner appear to us to be pre-cognitive if we could communicate with them? Would the feeling of being conscious be different for time-reversed people? [Here is one suggestion. There is one direction of time they would remember and call “the past,” and it would be when the entropy is lower. That is just as it is for us who do not experience time-reversal.] Consider communication between us and the inhabitants of that far off time-reversed region of the universe. If we sent a signal to the time-reversed region, could our message cross the border, or would it dissolve there, or would it bounce back? If residents of the time-reversed region successfully sent a recorded film across the border to us, should we play it in the ordinary way or in reverse?

11. What is Temporal Logic?

Temporal logic is the representation of reasoning about time by using the methods of symbolic logic in order to formalize which statements (or propositions or sentences) about time imply which others. For example, in McTaggart's B-series, the most important relation is the happens-before relation on events. Logicians have asked what sort of principles must this relation obey in order to properly account for our reasoning about time.

Here is one suggestion. Consider this informally valid reasoning:

Adam's arrival at the train station happened before Bryan's. Therefore, Bryan's arrival at the station did not happen before Adam's.

Let us translate this into classical predicate logic using a domain of instantaneous events, namely point events, where the individual constant 'a' denotes Adam's arrival at the train station, and 'b' denotes Bryan's arrival at the train station. Let the two-argument relation B(x,y) be interpreted as "x happens before y." The direct translation produces:


Unfortunately, this formal reasoning is invalid. To make the formal argument become valid, we could make explicit the implicit premise that the B relation is asymmetric. That is, we need to add the implicit premise:

∀x∀y[B(x,y)   ~B(y,x)]

So, we might want to add this principle as an axiom into our temporal logic.

In other informally valid reasoning, we discover a need to make even more assumptions about the happens-before relation. Suppose Adam arrived at the train station before Bryan, and suppose Bryan arrived before Charles. Is it valid reasoning to infer that Adam arrived before Charles? Yes, but if we translate directly into classical predicate logic we get this invalid argument:


To make this argument be valid we need the implicit premise that says the happens-before relation is transitive, that is:

∀x∀y∀z [(B(x,y) & B(y,z))  B(x,z)]

What other constraints should be placed on the B relation (when it is to be interpreted as the happens-before relation)? Logicians have offered many suggestions: that B is irreflexive, that in any reference frame any two events are related somehow by the B relation (there are no disconnected pairs of events), that B is dense in the sense that there is a third point event between any two point events that are not simultaneous, and so forth.

The more classical approach to temporal logic, however, does not add premises to arguments in classical predicate logic as we have just been doing. The classical approach is via tense logic, a formalism that adds tense operators on propositions of propositional logic. The pioneer in the late 1950s was A. N. Prior. He created a new symbolic logic to describe our reasoning involving time phrases such as “now,” “happens before,” “twenty-three minutes afterwards,” “at all times,” and “sometimes.” He hoped that a precise, formal treatment of these concepts could lead to resolution of some of the controversial philosophical issues about time.

Prior begins with an important assumption: that a proposition such as “Custer dies in Montana” can be true at one time and false at another time. That assumption is challenged by some philosophers, such as W.V. Quine, who prefer to avoid use of this sort of proposition and who recommend that temporal logics use only sentences that are timelessly true or timelessly false, and that have no indexicals whose reference can shift from one context to another.

Prior's main original idea was to appreciate that time concepts are similar in structure to modal concepts such as “it is possible that” and “it is necessary that.” He adapted modal propositional logic for his tense logic. Michael Dummett and E. J. Lemmon also made major, early contributions to tense logic. One standard system of tense logic is a variant of the S4.3 system of modal logic. In this formal tense logic, the modal operator that is interpreted to mean “it is possible that” is re-interpreted to mean “at some past time it was the case that” or, equivalently, “it once was the case that,” or "it once was that." Let the capital letter 'P' represent this operator. P will operate on present-tensed propositions, such as p. If p represents the proposition “Custer dies in Montana,” then Pp says Custer died in Montana. If Prior can make do with the variable p ranging only over present-tensed propositions, then he may have found a way to eliminate any ontological commitment to non-present entities such as dinosaurs while preserving the possibility of true past tense propositions such as "There were dinosaurs."

Prior added to the axioms of classical propositional logic the axiom P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq). The axiom says that for any two propositions p and q, at some past time it was the case that p or q if and only if either at some past time it was the case that p or at some past time (perhaps a different past time) it was the case that q.

If p is the proposition “Custer dies in Montana” and q is “Sitting Bull dies in Montana,” then

P(p v q) ↔ (Pp v Pq)


Custer or Sitting Bull died in Montana if and only if either Custer died in Montana or Sitting Bull died in Montana.

The S4.3 system’s key axiom is the equivalence, for all propositions p and q,

Pp & Pq ↔ [P(p & q) v P(p & Pq) v P(q & Pp)].

This axiom when interpreted in tense logic captures part of our ordinary conception of time as a linear succession of states of the world.

Another axiom of tense logic might state that if proposition q is true, then it will always be true that q has been true at some time. If H is the operator “It has always been the case that,” then a new axiom might be

Pp ↔ ~H~p.

This axiom of tense logic is analogous to the modal logic axiom that p is possible if and only if it is not the case that it is necessary that not-p.

A tense logic may need additional axioms in order to express “q has been true for the past two weeks.” Prior and others have suggested a wide variety of additional axioms for tense logic, but logicians still disagree about which axioms to accept.

It is controversial whether to add axioms that express the topology of time, for example that it comes to an end or doesn't come to an end; the reason is that this is an empirical matter, not a matter for logic to settle.

Regarding a semantics for tense logic, Prior had the idea that the truth of a tensed proposition should be expressed in terms of truth-at-a-time. For example, a modal proposition Pp (it was once the case that p) is true at a time t if and only if p is true at a time earlier than t. This suggestion has led to an extensive development of the formal semantics for tense logic.

The concept of being in the past is usually treated by metaphysicians as a predicate that assigns properties to events, but, in the tense logic just presented, the concept is treated as an operator P upon propositions, and this difference in treatment is objectionable to some metaphysicians.

The other major approach to temporal logic does not use a tense logic. Instead, it formalizes temporal reasoning within a first-order logic without modal-like tense operators. One method for developing ideas about temporal logic is the method of temporal arguments which adds an additional temporal argument to any predicate involving time in order to indicate how its satisfaction depends on time. A predicate such as “is less than seven” does not involve time, but the predicate “is resting” does, even though both use the word "is". If the “x is resting” is represented classically as P(x), where P is a one-argument predicate, then it could be represented in temporal logic instead as the two-argument predicate P(x,t), and this would be interpreted as saying x has property P at time t. P has been changed to a two-argument predicate by adding a “temporal argument.” The time variable 't' is treated as a new sort of variable requiring new axioms. Suggested new axioms allow time to be a dense linear ordering of instantaneous instants or to be continuous or to have some other structure.

Occasionally the method of temporal arguments uses a special constant symbol, say 'n', to denote now, the present time. This helps with the translation of common temporal sentences. For example, let Q(t) be interpreted as “Socrates is sitting down at t.” The sentence or proposition that Socrates has always been sitting down may be translated into first-order temporal logic as

(∀t)[(t < n) → Q(t)].

Some temporal logics allow sentences to lack both classical truth-values. The first person to give a clear presentation of the implications of treating declarative sentences as being neither true nor false was the Polish logician Jan Lukasiewicz in 1920. To carry out Aristotle’s suggestion that future contingent sentences do not yet have truth values, he developed a three-valued symbolic logic, with each grammatical declarative sentence having the truth-values True, or False, or else Indeterminate [T, F, or I]. Contingent sentences about the future, such as, "There will be a sea battle tomorrow," are assigned an I value in order to indicate the indeterminacy of the future. Truth tables for the connectives of propositional logic are redefined to maintain logical consistency and to maximally preserve our intuitions about truth and falsehood. See (Haack 1974) for more details about this application of three-valued logic.

Different temporal logics have been created depending on whether one wants to model circular time, discrete time, time obeying general relativity, the time of ordinary discourse, and so forth. For an introduction to tense logic and other temporal logics, see (Øhrstrøm and Hasle 1995).

12. Supplements

a. Frequently Asked Questions

The following questions are addressed in the Time Supplement article:

  1. What are Instants and Durations?
  2. What is an Event?
  3. What is a Reference Frame?
  4. What is an Inertial Frame?
  5. What is Spacetime?
  6. What is a Minkowski Diagram?
  7. What are the Metric and the Interval?
  8. Does the Theory of Relativity Imply Time is Part of Space?
  9. Is Time the Fourth Dimension?
  10. Is There More Than One Kind of Physical Time?
  11. How is Time Relative to the Observer?
  12. What is the Relativity of Simultaneity?
  13. What is the Conventionality of Simultaneity?
  14. What is the Difference Between the Past and the Absolute Past?
  15. What is Time Dilation?
  16. How does Gravity Affect Time?
  17. What Happens to Time Near a Black Hole?
  18. What is the Solution to the Twin Paradox (Clock Paradox)?
  19. What is the Solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes?
  20. How do Time Coordinates Get Assigned to Points of Spacetime?
  21. How do Dates Get Assigned to Actual Events?
  22. What is Essential to Being a Clock?
  23. What does It Mean for a Clock To Be Accurate?
  24. What is Our Standard Clock?
  25. Why are Some Standard Clocks Better Than Others?

b. What Science Requires of Time

c. Special Relativity: Proper times, Coordinate systems, and Lorentz Transformations

13. References and Further Reading

  • Butterfield, Jeremy. “Seeing the Present” Mind, 93, (1984), pp. 161-76.
    • Defends the B-camp position on the subjectivity of the present and its not being a global present.
  • Callender, Craig, and Ralph Edney. Introducing Time, Totem Books, USA, 2001.
    • A cartoon-style book covering most of the topics in this encyclopedia article in a more elementary way. Each page is two-thirds graphics and one-third text.
  • Callender, Craig and Carl Hoefer. “Philosophy of Space-Time Physics” in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Science, ed. by Peter Machamer and Michael Silberstein, Blackwell Publishers, 2002, pp. 173-98.
    • Discusses whether it is a fact or a convention that in a reference frame the speed of light going one direction is the same as the speed coming back.
  • Callender, Craig. "The Subjectivity of the Present," Chronos, V, 2003-4, pp. 108-126.
    • Surveys the psychological and neuroscience literature and suggests that the evidence tends to support the claim that our experience of the "now" is the experience of a subjective property rather than merely of an objective property, and it offers an interesting explanation of why so many people believe in the objectivity of the present.
  • Callender, Craig. "The Common Now," Philosophical Issues 18, pp. 339-361 (2008).
    • Develops the ideas presented in (Callender 2003-4).
  • Callender, Craig. "Is Time an Illusion?", Scientific American, June, 2010, pp. 58-65.
    • Explains how the belief that time is fundamental may be an illusion because time emerges from a universe that is basically static.
  • Carroll, John W. and Ned Markosian. An Introduction to Metaphysics. Cambridge University Press, 2010.
    • This introductory, undergraduate metaphysics textbook contains an excellent chapter introducing the metaphysical issues involving time, beginning with the McTaggart controversy.
  • Carroll, Sean. From Eternity to Here: The Quest for the Ultimate Theory of Time, Dutton/Penguin Group, New York, 2010.
    • Part Three "Entropy and Time's Arrow" provides a very clear explanation of the details of the problems involved with time's arrow. For an interesting answer to the question of whether any interaction between our part of the universe and a part in which the arrow of times goes in reverse, see endnote 137 for p. 164.
  • Carroll, Sean. "Ten Things Everyone Should Know About Time," Discover Magazine, Cosmic Variance, online 2011.
    • Contains the quotation about how the mind reconstructs its story of what is happening "now."
  • Damasio, Antonio R. “Remembering When,” Scientific American: Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 287, no. 3, 2002; reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp.34-41.
    • A look at the brain structures involved in how our mind organizes our experiences into the proper temporal order. Includes a discussion of Benjamin Libet’s discovery in the 1970s that the brain events involved in initiating a free choice occur about a third of a second before we are aware of our making the choice.
  • Dainton, Barry. Time and Space, Second Edition, McGill-Queens University Press: Ithaca, 2010.
    • A survey of all the topics in this article, but at a deeper level.
  • Davies, Paul. About Time: Einstein’s Unfinished Revolution, Simon & Schuster, 1995.
    • An easy to read survey of the impact of the theory of relativity on our understanding of time.
  • Davies, Paul. How to Build a Time Machine, Viking Penguin, 2002.
    • A popular exposition of the details behind the possibilities of time travel.
  • Deutsch, David and Michael Lockwood, “The Quantum Physics of Time Travel,” Scientific American, pp. 68-74. March 1994.
    • An investigation of the puzzle of getting information for free by traveling in time.
  • Dowden, Bradley. The Metaphysics of Time: A Dialogue, Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc. 2009.
    • An undergraduate textbook in dialogue form that covers most of the topics discussed in this encyclopedia article.
  • Dummett, Michael. “Is Time a Continuum of Instants?,” Philosophy, 2000, Cambridge University Press, pp. 497-515.
    • A constructivist model of time that challenges the idea that time is composed of durationless instants.
  • Earman, John. “Implications of Causal Propagation Outside the Null-Cone," Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 1972, pp. 222-37.
    • Describes his rocket paradox that challenges time travel to the past.
  • Grünbaum, Adolf. “Relativity and the Atomicity of Becoming,” Review of Metaphysics, 1950-51, pp. 143-186.
    • An attack on the notion of time’s flow, and a defense of the treatment of time and space as being continua and of physical processes as being aggregates of point-events. Difficult reading.
  • Haack, Susan. Deviant Logic, Cambridge University Press, 1974.
    • Chapter 4 contains a clear account of Aristotle’s argument (in section 9c of the present article) for truth value gaps, and its development in Lukasiewicz’s three-valued logic.
  • Hawking, Stephen. “The Chronology Protection Hypothesis,” Physical Review. D 46, p. 603, 1992.
    • Reasons for the impossibility of time travel.
  • Hawking, Stephen. A Brief History of Time, Updated and Expanded Tenth Anniversary Edition, Bantam Books, 1996.
    • A leading theoretical physicist provides introductory chapters on space and time, black holes, the origin and fate of the universe, the arrow of time, and time travel. Hawking suggests that perhaps our universe originally had four space dimensions and no time dimension, and time came into existence when one of the space dimensions evolved into a time dimension. He calls this space dimension “imaginary time.”
  • Horwich, Paul. Asymmetries in Time, The MIT Press, 1987.
    • A monograph that relates the central problems of time to other problems in metaphysics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language and philosophy of action.
  • Katzenstein, Larry, ed. Scientific American Special Edition: A Matter of Time, vol. 16, no. 1, 2006.
    • A collection of Scientific American articles about time.
  • Krauss, Lawrence M. and Glenn D. Starkman, “The Fate of Life in the Universe,” Scientific American Special Edition: The Once and Future Cosmos, Dec. 2002, pp. 50-57.
    • Discusses the future of intelligent life and how it might adapt to and survive the expansion of the universe.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, “Omniscience and Immutability,” The Journal of Philosophy, July 1966, pp. 409-421.
    • If God knows what time it is, does this demonstrate that God is not immutable?
  • Lasky, Ronald C. “Time and the Twin Paradox,” in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 21-23.
    • A short, but careful and authoritative analysis of the twin paradox, with helpful graphs showing how each twin would view his clock and the other twin’s clock during the trip. Because of the spaceship’s changing velocity by turning around, the twin on the spaceship has a shorter world-line than the Earth-based twin and takes less time than the Earth-based twin.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin and Murray MacBeath, The Philosophy of Time, Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • A collection of twelve influential articles on the passage of time, subjective facts, the reality of the future, the unreality of time, time without change, causal theories of time, time travel, causation, empty time, topology, possible worlds, tense and modality, direction and possibility, and thought experiments about time. Difficult reading for undergraduates.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin, Travels in Four Dimensions: The Enigmas of Space and Time, Oxford University Press, 2003.
    • A philosophical introduction to conceptual questions involving space and time. Suitable for use as an undergraduate textbook without presupposing any other course in philosophy. There is a de-emphasis on teaching the scientific theories, and an emphasis on elementary introductions to the relationship of time to change, the implications that different structures for time have for our understanding of causation, difficulties with Zeno’s Paradoxes, whether time passes, the nature of the present, and why time has an arrow. The treatment of time travel says, rather oddly, that time machines “disappear” and that when a “time machine leaves for 2101, it simply does not exist in the intervening times,” as measured from an external reference frame.
  • Lockwood, Michael, The Labyrinth of Time: Introducing the Universe, Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • A philosopher of physics presents the implications of contemporary physics for our understanding of time. Chapter 15, “Schrödinger’s Time-Traveller,” presents the Oxford physicist David Deutsch’s quantum analysis of time travel.
  • Markosian, Ned, “A Defense of Presentism,” in Zimmerman, Dean (ed.), Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, Oxford University Press, 2003.
  • Maudlin, Tim. The Metaphysics Within Physics, Oxford University Press, 2007.
    • Chapter 4, “On the Passing of Time,” defends the dynamic theory of time’s flow, and argues that the passage of time is objective.
  • McTaggart, J. M. E. The Nature of Existence, Cambridge University Press, 1927.
    • Chapter 33 restates more clearly the arguments that McTaggart presented in 1908 for his A series and B series and how they should be understood to show that time is unreal. Difficult reading. The argument that a single event is in the past, is present, and will be future yet it is inconsistent for an event to have more than one of these properties is called "McTaggart's Paradox." The chapter is renamed "The Unreality of Time," and is reprinted on pp. 23-59 of (LePoidevin and MacBeath 1993).
  • Mellor, D. H. Real Time II, International Library of Philosophy, 1998.
    • This monograph presents a subjective theory of tenses. Mellor argues that the truth conditions of any tensed sentence can be explained without tensed facts.
  • Mozersky, M. Joshua. "The B-Theory in the Twentieth Century," in A Companion to the Philosophy of Time. Ed. by Heather Dyke and Adrian Bardon, John Wiley & Sons, Inc., 2013, pp. 167-182.
    • A detailed evaluation and defense of the B-Theory.
  • Nadis, Steve. "Starting Point," Discover, September 2013, pp. 36-41.
    • Non-technical discussion of the argument by cosmologist Alexander Vilenkin that the past of the multiverse must be finite but its future must be infinite.
  • Newton-Smith, W. H. The Structure of Time, Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1980.
    • A survey of the philosophical issues involving time. It emphasizes the logical and mathematical structure of time.
  • Norton, John. "Time Really Passes," Humana.Mente: Journal of Philosophical Studies, 13 April 2010.
    • Argues that "We don't find passage in our present theories and we would like to preserve the vanity that our physical theories of time have captured all the important facts of time. So we protect our vanity by the stratagem of dismissing passage as an illusion."
  • Øhrstrøm, P. and P.  F. V. Hasle. Temporal Logic: from Ancient Ideas to Artificial Intelligence. Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1995.
    • An elementary introduction to the logic of temporal reasoning.
  • Perry, John. "The Problem of the Essential Indexical," Noûs, 13(1), (1979), pp. 3-21.
    • Argues that indexicals are essential to what we want to say in natural language; they cannot be eliminated in favor of B-theory discourse.
  • Pinker, Steven. The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature, Penguin Group, 2007.
    • Chapter 4 discusses how the conceptions of space and time are expressed in language in a way very different from that described by either Kant or Newton. Page 189 says that t in only half the world’s languages is the ordering of events expressed in the form of grammatical tenses. Chinese has no tenses.
  • Pöppel, Ernst. Mindworks: Time and Conscious Experience. San Diego: Harcourt Brace Jovanovich. 1988.
    • A neuroscientist explores our experience of time.
  • Prior, A. N. “Thank Goodness That’s Over,” Philosophy, 34 (1959), p. 17.
    • Argues that a tenseless or B-theory of time fails to account for our relief that painful past events are in the past rather than in the present.
  • Prior, A. N. Past, Present and Future, Oxford University Press, 1967.
    • A pioneering work in temporal logic, the symbolic logic of time, which permits propositions to be true at one time and false at another.
  • Prior, A. N. “Critical Notices: Richard Gale, The Language of Time,” Mind78, no. 311, 1969, 453-460.
    • Contains his attack on the attempt to define time in terms of causation.
  • Prior, A. N. “The Notion of the Present,” Studium Generale, volume 23, 1970, pp. 245-8.
    • A brief defense of presentism, the view that the past and the future are not real.
  • Putnam, Hilary. "Time and Physical Geometry," The Journal of Philosophy, 64 (1967), pp. 240-246.
    • Comments on whether Aristotle is a presentist and why Aristotle was wrong if Relativity is right.
  • Russell, Bertrand. "On the Experience of Time," Monist, 25 (1915), pp. 212-233.
    • The classical tenseless theory.
  • Saunders, Simon. "How Relativity Contradicts Presentism," in Time, Reality & Experience edited by Craig Callender, Cambridge University Press, 2002, pp. 277-292.
    • Reviews the arguments for and against the claim that, since the present in the theory of relativity is relative to reference frame, presentism must be incorrect.
  • Savitt, Steven F. (ed.). Time’s Arrows Today: Recent Physical and Philosophical Work on the Direction of Time. Cambridge University Press, 1995.
    • A survey of research in this area, presupposing sophisticated knowledge of mathematics and physics.
  • Sciama, Dennis. “Time ‘Paradoxes’ in Relativity,” in The Nature of Time edited by Raymond Flood and Michael Lockwood, Basil Blackwell, 1986, pp. 6-21.
    • A good account of the twin paradox.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. “Time without Change,” Journal of Philosophy, 66 (1969), pp. 363-381.
    • A thought experiment designed to show us circumstances in which the esxistence of changeless intervals in the universe could be detected.
  • Sider, Ted. “The Stage View and Temporary Intrinsics,” The Philosophical Review, 106 (2) (2000), pp. 197-231.
    • Examines the problem of temporary intrinsics and the pros and cons of four-dimensionalism.
  • Sklar, Lawrence. Space, Time, and Spacetime, University of California Press, 1976.
    • Chapter III, Section E discusses general relativity and the problem of substantival spacetime, where Sklar argues that Einstein’s theory does not support Mach’s views against Newton’s interpretations of his bucket experiment; that is, Mach’s argument against substantivialism fails.
  • Sorabji, Richard. Matter, Space, & Motion: Theories in Antiquity and Their Sequel. Cornell University Press, 1988.
    • Chapter 10 discusses ancient and contemporary accounts of circular time.
  • Steinhardt, Paul J. "The Inflation Debate: Is the theory at the heart of modern cosmology deeply flawed?" Scientific American, April, 2011, pp. 36-43.
    • Argues that the Big Bang Theory with inflation is incorrect and that we need a cyclic cosmology with an eternal series of Big Bangs and big crunches but with no inflation.
  • Thomson, Judith Jarvis. "Parthood and Identity across Time," Journal of Philosophy 80, 1983, 201-20.
    • Argues against four-dimensionalism and its idea of objects having infinitely many temporal parts.
  • Thorne, Kip S. Black Holes and Time Warps: Einstein’s Outrageous Legacy, W. W. Norton & Co., 1994.
    • Chapter 14 is a popular account of how to use a wormhole to create a time machine.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas C. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Time and Space, Columbia University Press, 1985.
    • An advanced undergraduate textbook by an important philosopher of science.
  • Veneziano, Gabriele. “The Myth of the Beginning of Time,” Scientific American, May 2004, pp. 54-65, reprinted in Katzenstein, 2006, pp. 72-81.
    • An account of string theory’s impact on our understanding of time’s origin. Veneziano hypothesizes that our Big Bang was not the origin of time but simply the outcome of a preexisting state.
  • Whitrow. G. J. The Natural Philosophy of Time, Second Edition, Clarendon Press, 1980.
    • A broad survey of the topic of time and its role in physics, biology, and psychology. Pitched at a higher level than the Davies books.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.


If we were pressed to give a definition of emergence, we could say that a property is emergent if it is a novel property of a system or an entity that arises when that system or entity has reached a certain level of complexity and that, even though it exists only insofar as the system or entity exists, it is distinct from the properties of the parts of the system from which it emerges. However, as will become apparent, things are not so simple because “emergence” is a term used in different ways both in science and in philosophy, and how it is to be defined is a substantive question in itself.

The term “emergence” comes from the Latin verb emergo which means to arise, to rise up, to come up or to come forth. The term was coined by G. H. Lewes in Problems of Life and Mind (1875) who drew the distinction between emergent and resultant effects.

Effects are resultant if they can be calculated by the mere addition or subtraction of causes operating together, as with the weight of an object, when one can calculate its weight merely by adding the weights of the parts that make it up. Effects are emergent if they cannot be thus calculated, because they are qualitatively novel compared to the causes from which they emerge. For Lewes, examples of such emergent effects are mental properties that emerge from neural processes yet are not properties of the parts of the neural processes from which they emerge.  In Lewes’ work, three essential features of emergence are laid out. First, that emergentism is a theory about the structure of the natural world; and, consequently, it has ramifications concerning the unity of science. Second, that emergence is a relation between properties of an entity and the properties of its parts. Third, that the question of emergence is related to the question of the possibility of reduction. These three features will structure this article's discussion of emergence.

Table of Contents

  1. The British Emergentists
    1. J. S. Mill
    2. Samuel Alexander
    3. C. Lloyd Morgan
    4. C. D. Broad
  2. Later Emergentism
    1. Kinds of Emergence
      1. Strong and Weak Emergence
        1. Strong Emergence: Novelty as Irreducibility and Downward Causation
        2. Weak Emergence: Novelty as Unpredictability
      2. Synchronic and Diachronic Emergence
    2. Emergence and Supervenience
  3. Objections to Emergentism
    1. The Supervenience Argument
    2. Do Cases of Genuine (Strong) Emergence Exist?
  4. References and Further Reading

1. The British Emergentists

The group of emergentists that Brian McLaughlin (1992) has dubbed the “British emergentists” were the first to make emergence the core of a comprehensive philosophical position in the second half of the nineteenth century and the beginning of the twentieth century. A central question at that time was whether life, mind and chemical bonding could be given a physical explanation and, by extension, whether special sciences such as psychology and biology were reducible to more “basic”’ sciences and, eventually, to physics. Views were divided between the reductionist mechanists and the anti-reductionist vitalists. The mechanists claimed that the properties of an organism are resultant properties that can be fully explained, actually or in principle, in terms of the properties and relations of its parts. The vitalists claimed that organic matter differs fundamentally from inorganic matter and that what accounts for the properties of living organisms is not the arrangement of their constitutive physical and chemical parts, but some sort of entelechy or spirit. In this debate the emergentists proposed a middle way in which, against the mechanists, the whole is more than just the sum and arrangement of its parts yet, against the vitalists, without anything being added to it “from the outside”—that is, there is no need to posit any mysterious intervening entelechy to explain irreducible emergent properties.

Though the views of the British emergentists differ in their details we can generally say they were monists regarding objects or substances in as much as the world is made of fundamentally one kind of thing, matter. However, they also held that at different levels of organization and complexity matter exhibits different properties that are novel relative to the lower levels of organization from which they emerged and this makes the emergentist view one of property dualism (or pluralism). It should also be noted that the British emergentists identified their view as a naturalist position firstly because whether something is emergent or not is to be established or rejected by empirical evidence alone, and secondly because no extra-natural powers, entelechies, souls and so forth are used in emergentist explanations. The main texts of this tradition of the so-called “British emergentists” are J. S. Mill’s System of Logic, Samuel Alexander’s Space, Time and Deity, C. Lloyd Morgan’s Emergent Evolution and C. D. Broad’s The Mind and its Place in Nature. Beyond these emergentists, traditional brands of emergentism can be found in the work of R. W. Sellars (1922), A. Lovejoy (1927), Roger Sperry (1980, 1991), Karl Popper and John Eccles (1977) and Michael Polanyi (1968).

a. J. S. Mill

Though he did not use the term ‘emergence,’ it was Mill’s System of Logic (1843) that marked the beginning of British emergentism.

Mill distinguished between two modes of what he called “the conjoint action of causes,” the mechanical and the chemical. In the mechanical mode the effect of a group of causes is nothing more than the sum of the effects that each individual cause would have were it acting alone. Mill calls the principle according to which the whole effect is the sum of the effects of its parts the “principle of composition of causes” and illustrates it by reference to the vector sum of forces. The effects thus produced in the mechanical mode are called “homopathic effects” and they are subject to causal “homopathic laws.” Mill contrasts the mechanical mode with the chemical mode in which the principle of composition of causes does not hold. In the chemical mode causal effects are not additive but, instead, they are “heteropathic” which means that the conjoint effect of different causes is different from the sum the effects the causes would have in isolation. The paradigmatic examples of such effects were, for Mill, the products of chemical reactions which have different properties and effects than those of the individual reactants. Take, for example a typical substitution reaction:

Zn + 2HCl → ZnCl2 + H2.

In such a reaction zinc reacts with hydrogen chloride and replaces the hydrogen in the latter to produce effects that are more than just the sum of the parts that came together at the beginning of the reaction. The newly formed zinc chloride has properties that neither zinc nor hydrogen chloride possess separately.

Mill’s heteropathic effects are the equivalent of Lewes’ emergent effects, whereas homopathic effects are the equivalent of Lewes’ resultants. Heteropathic effects are subject, according to Mill, to causal “heteropathic” laws which, though now relative to the laws of the levels from which they emerged, do not counteract them. Such laws are found in the special sciences such as chemistry, biology and psychology.

b. Samuel Alexander

In Space, Time and Deity (1920), Samuel Alexander built a complex metaphysical system that has been subject to a number of different interpretations. As we shall see, Alexander in effect talks of different levels of explanation as opposed to the more robust ontological emergence we find in the works of the other British emergentists.

According to Alexander, all processes are physico-chemical processes but as their complexity increases they give rise to emergent qualities that are distinctive of the new complex configurations. These are subject to special laws that are treated by autonomous special sciences that give higher-order explanations of the behavior of complex configurations. One kind of such emergent qualities is mental qualities (others are biological and chemical qualities). Since for Alexander all processes are physico-chemical processes, mental processes are identical to neural processes. However Alexander claims that mental qualities are distinctive of higher-order configurations. Furthermore, Alexander claims, mental qualities are not epiphenomenal. A neural process that lost its mental qualities would not be the same process because it is in virtue of its mental qualities that the “nervous”—neural—process has the character and effects that it has. So though emergent qualities are co-instantiated in one instance in a physico-chemical process, they are distinct from that process due to their novel causal powers.

Alexander also holds that emergent qualities and their behavior cannot be deduced even by a Laplacean calculator from knowledge of the qualities and laws of the lower—physiological—order. To be precise, though a Laplacean calculator could predict all physical processes (and hence all mental processes, since mental processes are physical processes) he would not be able to predict the emergent qualities of those events because their configuration, though being in its entirety physico-chemical, exhibits different behavior from the kind the physico-chemical sciences are concerned with and this behavior is, in turn, captured by emergent laws. Hence the emergence of such qualities should be taken as a brute empirical fact that can be given no explanation and should be accepted with “natural piety”. However it should be noted here that Alexander leaves open the possibility that, if chemical properties were to be reduced without residue to physico-chemical processes, then they would not be emergent, and he adds that the same holds for mental properties.

c. C. Lloyd Morgan

In Emergent Evolution (1923) (and subsequently in Life, Spirit and Mind [1926] and The Emergence of Novelty [1933]) the biologist C. Lloyd Morgan introduced the notion of emergence into the notion of the process of evolution and maintained that in the course of evolution new properties and behaviors emerge (like life, mind and reflective thought) that cannot be predicted from the already existing entities they emerged from. Taking off from Mill and Lewes, Morgan cites as the paradigmatic case of an emergent phenomenon the products of chemical reactions that are novel and unpredictable. These novel properties, moreover, are not merely epiphenomenal but bring about “a new kind of relatedness”—new lawful connections—that affects the “manner of go” of lower-level events in a way that would not occur had they been absent. Thus emergent properties are causally autonomous and have downward causal powers.

d. C. D. Broad

The last major work in the British emergentist tradition and, arguably, the historical foundation of contemporary discussions of emergence in philosophy, was C. D. Broad’s Mind and Its Place in Nature (1925).

Broad identified three possible answers to the question of how the properties of a complex system are related to the properties of its parts. The “component theory” of the vitalists, the reductive answer of the mechanists and the emergentist view that the behavior of the whole cannot in principle be deduced from knowledge of the parts and their arrangement.  From this latter view—Broad's own—it follows that contrary to the mechanist’s view of the world as homogeneous throughout, reality is structured in aggregates of different order. Different orders in this sense exhibit different organizational complexity and the kinds that make up each order are made up of the kinds to be found in lower orders. This lack of unity is, in turn, reflected in the sciences, where there is a hierarchy with physics at the lower order and then ascending chemistry, biology and psychology—the subject matter of each being properties of different orders that are irreducible to properties of the lower orders. According to Broad these different orders are subject to different kinds of laws: trans-ordinal laws that connect properties of adjacent orders and intra-ordinal laws that hold between properties within the same order. Trans-ordinal laws, Broad writes, cannot be deduced from intra-ordinal laws and principles that connect the vocabularies of the two orders between which they hold; trans-ordinal laws are irreducible to intra-ordinal laws and, as such, are fundamental emergent laws—they are metaphysical brute facts.

Broad considered the question whether a trans-ordinal law is emergent to be an empirical question. Though he considered the behavior of all chemical compounds irreducible and thus emergent, he admitted, like Alexander, that if one day it is reduced to the physical characteristics of the chemical compound’s components it will not then count as emergent. However, unlike Alexander, he did not consider the same possible concerning the phenomenal experiences that “pure”—secondary—qualities of objects cause in us. Broad calls trans-ordinal laws that hold between physical properties and secondary qualities “trans-physical laws”. Though he is willing to grant that it could turn out that we mistakenly consider some trans-ordinal laws to be emergent purely on the basis of our incomplete knowledge, trans-physical laws are necessarily emergent—we could never have formed the concept of blue, no matter how much knowledge we had of colors, unless we had experienced it.  Broad puts forward an a priori argument to this effect that can be seen as a precursor of the knowledge argument against physicalism. These qualities, he says, could not have been predicted even by a “mathematical archangel” who knows everything there is to know about the structure and working of the physical world and can perform any mathematical calculation—they are in principle irreducible, only inductively predictable and hence emergent.

In this we see that Broad’s emergentism concerning the phenomenal experience of secondary qualities is not epistemological (as is sometimes suggested by his writings) but is a consequence of an ontological distinction of properties. That is, the impossibility of prediction which he cites as a criterion of emergence is a consequence of the metaphysical structure of the world; the “mathematical archangel” could not have predicted emergent properties not because of complexity or because of limits to what can be expressed by lower-level concepts, but because emergent facts and laws are brute facts or else are laws that are in principle not reductively explainable.

2. Later Emergentism

Beginning in the late 1920’s, advances in science such as the explanation of chemical bonding by quantum mechanics and the development of molecular biology put an end to claims of emergence in chemistry and biology and thus marked the beginning of the fall of the emergentist heyday and the beginning of an era of reductionist enthusiasm. However, beginning with Putnam’s arguments for multiple realizability in the 1960’s, Davidson’s anomalous monism of the psychophysical and Fodor’s argument for the autonomy of the special sciences, the identity theory  and reductionism were dealt a severe blow. Today, within a predominant anti-reductivist monist climate, emergentism has reappeared in complex systems theory, cognitive science and the philosophy of mind.

a. Kinds of Emergence

Because emergent properties are novel properties, there are different conceptions of what counts as emergent depending on how novelty is understood, and this is reflected in the different ways the concept of emergence is used in the philosophy of mind and in the natural and cognitive sciences. To capture this difference, David Chalmers (2006) drew the distinction between weak and strong emergence. A different distinction has been drawn by O’Connor and Wong (2002) between epistemological and ontological emergence, but this can be incorporated into the distinction between weak and strong emergence becasue ultimately both differentiate between an epistemological emergence couched in terms of higher and lower-level explanations or descriptions and a robust ontological difference between emergent and non-emergent phenomena. Beyond this, accounts of emergence differ in whether novelty is understood as occurring over time or whether it is a phenomenon restricted to a particular time. This difference is meant to be captured in the distinction between synchronic and diachronic emergence.

i. Strong and Weak Emergence

1. Strong Emergence: Novelty as Irreducibility and Downward Causation

The metaphysically interesting aspect of emergence is the question of what it takes for there to be genuinely distinct things. In other words, the question is whether a plausible metaphysical distinction can be made between things that are “nothing over and above” what constitutes them and those things that are “something over and above” their constituent parts. The notion of strong emergence that is predominant in philosophy is meant to capture this ontological distinction that was part of the initial motivation of the British emergentists and which is lacking in discussions of weak emergence.

Though a phenomenon is often said to be strongly emergent because it is not deducible from knowledge of the lower-level domain from which it emerged—as was the case for C.D. Broad—what distinguishes the thesis of strong emergence from a thesis only about our epistemological predicament is that this non-deducibility is in principle a consequence of an ontological distinction.  The question then is what sort of novelty must a property exhibit in order for it to be strongly emergent?

Even reductive physicalists can agree that a property can be novel to a whole even though it is nothing more than the sum of the related properties of the parts of the whole. For instance, a whole weighs as much as the sum of the weights of its parts, yet the weight of the whole is not something that its parts share. In this sense resultant systemic properties, like weight, are novel but not in the sense required for them to be strongly emergent. Also, numerical novelty, the fact that a property is instantiated for the first time, is not enough to make it strongly emergent for, again, that would make many resultant properties emergent, like the first time a specific shape or mass is instantiated in nature.

For this reason the criterion often cited as essential for the ontological autonomy of strong emergents (along with in principle irreducibility or non-deducibility) is causal novelty.  That is, the basic tenet of strong emergentism is that at a certain level of physical complexity novel properties appear that are not shared by the parts of the object they emerge from, that are ontologically irreducible to the more fundamental matter from which they emerge and that contribute causally to the world. That is, emergent properties have new downward causal powers that are irreducible to the causal powers of the properties of their subvenient or subjacent (to be more etymologically correct) base. Ontological emergentism is therefore typically committed not only to novel fundamental properties but also to fundamental emergent laws as was the case with the British emergentists who, with the exception of Alexander, were all committed to downward causation—that is, causation from macroscopic levels to microscopic levels. (It should be noted also that this ontological autonomy of emergents implies the existence of irreducible special sciences.) Thus Timothy O’Connor (1994) defines strong emergent properties as properties that supervene on properties of the parts of a complex object, that are not shared by any of the objects parts, are distinct from any structural property of the complex, and that have downward causal influence on the behavior of the complex’s parts.

However, though downward causal powers are commonly cited along with irreducibility as a criterion for strong emergence, there is no consensus regarding what is known as “Alexander’s dictum” (that is, that for something to be real it must have causal powers) and hence not everyone agrees that strong emergentism requires downward causation. For example, David Chalmers (2006) who is neutral on the question of epiphenomenalism, does not take downward causation to be an essential feature of emergentism. Rather, Chalmers defines a high-level phenomenon as strongly emergent when it is systematically determined by low-level facts but nevertheless truths concerning that phenomenon are in principle not deducible from truths in the lower-level domain. The question is posed by Chalmers in terms of conceptual entailment failure. That is, emergent phenomena are nomologically but not logically supervenient on lower-level facts and therefore novel fundamental laws are needed to connect properties of the two domains.

A different approach is offered by Tim Crane (2001, 2010) who bases his account of strong emergence on the distinction between two kinds of reduction: (1) ontological reduction, which identifies entities in one domain with those in another, more fundamental one, and (2) explanatory reduction: that is, a relation that holds between theories aimed at understanding phenomena of one level of reality in terms of a “lower” level. In other words, one theory, T2, is explanatorily reduced to another, T1, when theory T1 sheds light on the phenomena treated in T2; that is, shows from within theory T1 why T2 is true. Crane argues that the difference between strong emergentism and non-reductive physicalism lies in their respective attitude to reduction: though both non-reductive physicalism and emergentism deny ontological reduction, non-reductive physicalism requires explanatory reduction (at least in principle) whereas the distinguishing feature of emergentism is that it denies explanatory reduction and is committed to an explanatory gap. Crane argues that if you have supervenience with in-principle irreducibility and downward causation then you have dependence without explanatory reduction and, hence, strong emergence.

2. Weak Emergence: Novelty as Unpredictability

Weak emergence is the kind of emergence that is common in the early twenty-first century primarily (though not exclusively) in cognitive science, complex system theory and, generally, scientific discussions of emergence in which the notions of complexity, functional organization, self-organization and non-linearity are central. The core of this position is that a property is emergent if it is a systemic property of a system—a property of a system that none if its smaller parts share—and it is unpredictable or unexpected given the properties and the laws governing the lower-level, more fundamental, domain from which it emerged. Since weak emergence is defined in terms of unpredictability or unexpectedness, it is an epistemological rather than a metaphysical notion. Commonly cited examples of such weak emergent phenomena range from emergent patterns in cellular automata and systemic properties of connectionist networks to phase transitions, termite organization, traffic jams, the flocking patterns of birds, and so on.

Weak emergence is compatible with reduction since a phenomenon may be unpredictable yet also reducible. For instance, processes comprised of many parts may fall under strict deterministic laws yet be unpredictable due to the unforeseeable consequences of minute initial conditions. And, as Chalmers (2006) argues, weak emergence is also compatible with deducibility of the emergent phenomenon from its base, as for instance, in cellular automata in which though higher-level patterns may be unexpected they are in principle deducible given the initial state of the base entities and the basic rules governing the lower level.

Mario Bunge’s “rational emergentism” (1977) is a form of weak emergence according to which emergent properties are identified with systemic properties that none of the parts of the system share and that are reducible to the parts of the system and their organization. Bunge identifies his view as an emergentism of sorts because he claims that, unlike reductionist mechanism it appreciates the novelty of systemic properties. In addition, he thinks of novelty as having a reductive explanation. He calls this “rational” emergence.

William Wimsatt (2000) also defends an account according to which emergence is compatible with reduction. Wimsatt defines emergence negatively as the failure of aggregativity; aggregativity is the state in which “the whole is nothing more than the sum of its parts” in which, that is, systemic properties are the result of the component parts of a system rather than their organization. Contrasting emergence to aggregativity, Wimsatt defines a systemic property as emergent relative to the properties of the parts of a system if the property is dependent on their mode of organization (and is also context-sensitive) rather than solely on the system’s composition. He argues that, in fact, it is aggregativity which is very rare in nature, while emergence is a common phenomenon (even if in different degrees).

Robert Batterman (2002), who focuses on emergence in physics, also believes that emergent phenomena are common in our everyday experience of the physical world. According to Batterman, what is at the heart of the question of emergence is not downward causation or the distinctness of emergent properties, but rather inter-theoretic reduction and, specifically, the limits of the explanatory power of reducing theories. Thus, a property is emergent, according to this view, if it is a property of a complex system at limit values that cannot be derived from lower level, more fundamental theories. As examples of emergent phenomena Batterman cites phase transitions and transitions of magnetic materials from ferromagnetic states to paramagnetic states, phenomena in which novel behavior is exhibited that cannot be reductively explained by the more fundamental theories of statistical mechanics. However, Batterman wants to distinguish explanation from reduction and so claims that though emergent phenomena are irreducible they are not unexplainable per se because they can have non-reductive explanations.

More recently Mark Bedau (1997, 2007, 2008) has argued that the characteristic of weak emergence is that, though macro-phenomena of complex systems are in principle ontologically and causally reducible to micro-phenomena, their reductive explanation is intractably complex, save by derivation through simulation of the system’s microdynamics and external conditions. In other words, though macro-phenomena are explainable in principle in terms of micro-phenomena, these explanations are incompressible, in the sense that they can only be had by “crawling the micro-causal web”—by aggregating and iterating all local micro-interactions over time. Bedau argues that this is the only kind of real emergence and champions what he calls the “radical view” of emergence according to which emergence is a common phenomenon that applies to all novel macro-properties of systems. (He contrasts this to what he calls the “sparse view” which he characterizes as the view that emergence is a rare phenomenon found only in “exotic” phenomena such as consciousness that are beyond the scope of normal science.) However, though this is a weak kind of emergence in that it denies any strong form of downward causation and it involves reducibility of the macro to the micro (even if only in principle), Bedau denies that weak emergence is merely epistemological, or merely “in the mind” since explanations of weak emergent phenomena are incompressible because they reflect the incompressible nature of the micro-causal structure of reality which is an objective feature of complex systems.

Andy Clark (1997, 2001) also holds a weak emergentist view according to which emergent phenomena need not be restricted to unpredictable or unexplainable phenomena but are, instead, systemic phenomena of complex dynamical systems that are the products of collective activity. Clark distinguishes four kinds of emergence. First, emergence as collective self-organization (a system becomes more organized due solely to the collective effects of the local interaction of its parts, such as  flocking patterns of birds, or due to the collective effects of its parts and the environment, such as termite nest building). Second, emergence as unprogrammed functionality, that is, emergent behavior that arises from repeated interaction of an agent with the environment, such as wall-following behavior in “veer and bounce” robots (Clark, 1997). Third, emergence as interactive complexity in which effects, patterns or capacities of a system emerge resulting from complex, cyclic interaction of its components. For example, Bénard and Couette convection cells that result from a repetitive cycle of movement caused by differences in density within a fluid body in which the colder fluid forces the warmer fluid to rise until the latter loses enough heat to descend and cause the former fluid to rise again, and so on. And fourth, emergence as uncompressible unfolding (phenomena that cannot be predicted without simulation). All of these formulations of emergence are compatible with reducibility or in principle predictability and are thus forms of weak emergence. For Clark, emergence picks out the “distinctive way” in which factors conspire to bring about a property, event or pattern and it is “linked to the notion of what variables figure in a good explanation of the behavior of a system.” Thus, Clark’s notion of emergence in complex systems theory is explanatory in that it focuses on explanations in terms of collective variables, that is, variables that focus on higher-level features of complex dynamical systems that do not track properties of the components of the system but, instead, reflect the result of the interaction of multiple agents or their interaction with their environment.

Proponents of weak emergence do not support the strong notion of downward causation that is found in strong emergentist views but, instead, favor one in which higher-level causal powers of a whole can be explained by rules of interaction of its parts, such as feedback loops. Though this kind of view of emergence is predominant in the sciences, it is not exclusive to them. A form of weak emergence within philosophy that denies strong downward causation can be found in John Searle (1992). Searle allows for the existence of “causally emergent system features” such as liquidity, transparency and consciousness that are systemic features of a system that cannot be deduced or predicted from knowledge of causal interactions of lower levels. However, according to Searle, whatever causal effects such features exhibit can be explained by the causal relations of the systems parts, for example, in the case of consciousness, by the behavior and interaction of neurons.

If we make use, for more precision, of the distinction between ontological and explanatory reduction we can see that if we understand strongly emergent phenomena as both ontologically and explanatorily irreducible, as Crane (2010) does, then they are also weakly emergent. However, if strongly emergent phenomena are only ontologically irreducible they may still be, in principle, predictable. For example, even if you deny the identity of heat with mean kinetic energy (perhaps because of multiple realizability) a Laplacean demon could still predict a gas’ heat from the mean kinetic energy of its molecules with the use of “bridge laws” that link the two vocabularies. These bridge laws can be considered to be part of what Crane calls an explanatory reduction. So in such cases, strong emergence does not entail weak emergence. Also it should be noted that weak emergence does not entail strong emergence. A phenomenon can be unpredictable yet also ontologically reducible: perhaps for instance, because systemic properties are subject to indeterministic laws. So a case of weak emergence need not necessarily be a case of strong emergence.

ii. Synchronic and Diachronic Emergence

Another distinction that is made concerning how novelty is understood is the distinction between synchronic and diachronic novelty. The former is novelty exhibited in the properties of a system vis-à-vis the properties of its constituent parts at a particular time; the latter is temporal novelty in the sense that a property or state is novel if it is instantiated for the first time. This distinction leads to distinction between synchronic and diachronic emergence.

In synchronic emergence, articulated by C. D. Broad and predominant in the philosophy of mind, the higher-level, emergent phenomena are simultaneously present with the lower-level phenomena from which they emerge. Usually this form of emergence is stated in terms of supervenience of mental phenomena on subvenient/subjacent neural structures, and so mental states or properties co-exist with states or properties at the neural level. Strong ontological emergence is thus usually understood to be synchronic, “vertical”, emergence. In contrast, diachronic emergence is “horizontal” emergence evolved through time in which the structure from which the novel property emerges exists prior to the emergent. This is typical of the weakly emergent states appealed to in discussions of complex systems, evolution, cosmology, artificial life, and so forth. It can be found in Searle (1992) since he views the relation of the emergent to its base as causal thus, at least in non-synchronic accounts of causation, excluding synchronic emergence.

Because diachronic emergence is emergence over time, novelty is understood in terms of unpredictability of states or properties of a system from past states of that system. And because weak emergence is typically defined in terms of unpredictability it is also usually identified with cases of diachronic emergence. In contrast, in synchronic emergence, which refers to the state of a system at a particular time, novelty revolves around the idea of irreducibility and thus synchronic emergence is usually identified with strong emergence. However, there are formulations of non-supervenience-based strong emergence that are causal and diachronic, such as O’Connor and Wong’s (2005). Note that synchronic emergence could be the result of diachronic emergence but is not entailed by it since, presumably, if God were to create the world exactly as it is in this moment, synchronically emergent phenomena would exist without them being diachronically emergent.

b. Emergence and Supervenience

The British emergentists, and this is especially clear in the writing of C. D. Broad, thought that a necessary feature of emergentism is a relation of the kind we would today call supervenience. Supervenience is a relation of covariation between two sets of properties, subjacent/underlying properties and supervenient properties. Roughly, we say that a set of properties A supervenes on a set of properties B if and only if two things that differ with respect to A-properties will also differ with respect to B-properties. Today, because of the failure of successful reductions, especially in the case of the mental to the physical, and because the relation of supervenience per se doesn’t entail anything about the specific nature of the properties it relates, for example, whether they are distinct or not, it has been seen as a prima facie good candidate for a key feature of the relation between emergents and their subjacent base that can account for the distinctness and dependence of emergents while also adding the restriction of synchronicity. Jaegwon Kim (1999), James van Cleve (1990), Timothy O’Connor (1994), Brian McLaughlin (1997), David Chalmers (2006) and Paul Noordhof (2010) all take nomological strong supervenience to be a necessary feature of emergentism. (For present purposes, following Kim we can define strong supervenience thus: A-properties strongly supervene on B-properties if and only if for any possible worlds w1 and w2 and any individuals x in w1 and y in w2, if x in w1 is B-indiscernible from y in w2, then x in w1 is A-indiscernible from y in w2. Nomological supervenience restricts the range of possible worlds to those that conform to the natural laws).

However, not everyone agrees that the relation of strong supervenience is necessary for strong emergence. Some, like Crane (2001), argue that supervenience is not sufficient for emergence and other proponents of strong emergence have questioned that supervenience is even a necessary condition for emergence. For example, O’Connor (2000, 2003, O’Connor & Wong 2005) now supports a form of dynamical emergence which is causal and non-synchronic. A state of an entity is emergent, in this view, if it instantiates non-structural properties as a causal result of that object’s achieving a complex configuration. O’Connor’s view includes a strong notion of downward causation (and the denial of causal closure–roughly, the principle that all physical effects are entirely determined by, or have their chances entirely determined by, prior physical events) and the possibility that an emergent state can generate another emergent state.

Paul Humphreys (1996, 1997) has also offered an alternative account to supervenience-based emergence according to which emergence of properties is the diachronic result of fusion of lower-level properties, a phenomenon that Humphreys claims is common in the physical realm. That is, properties of the base are fused (thereby ceasing to exist) and give rise to new emergent properties with novel causal powers which are not made up of the old property instances—and, in this sense, the only real phenomenon is the emergent phenomenon. Humphreys offers as a paradigmatic example of such emergence quantum entanglement, in which a system can be in a definite state while its individual parts are not and in which the state of the system determines the states of its parts and not the other way around. It must be noted that Humphreys claims ignorance about whether this is what happens in the case of mental properties. Different formulations of non-supervenience-based emergence can be found in Silberstein and McGeever (1999) who have also argued for ontological emergence in quantum mechanics and, by extension, as a real feature of the natural world, as well as in Bickhard and Campbell’s (2000) “process model” of ontological emergence.

3. Objections to Emergentism

a. The Supervenience Argument

The most usually cited objection to strong emergence, initially formulated by Pepper (1926) and championed today by Jaegwon Kim (1999, 2005), concerns the novel (and downward) causal powers of emergent properties.

Kim’s formulation is based on three basic physicalist assumptions: (1) the principle of causal closure which Kim defines as the principle that if a physical event has a cause at t, then it has a physical cause at t, (2) the principle of causal exclusion according to which if an event e has a sufficient cause at t, no event at t distinct from c can be the cause of e (unless this is a genuine case of causal over-determination), and (3) supervenience. Kim defines mind/body supervenience as follows: mental properties strongly supervene on physical/biological properties, that is, if any system s instantiates a mental property M at t, there necessarily exists a physical property P such that s instantiates P at t, and necessarily anything instantiating P at any time instantiates M at any time.

The gist of the problem is the following. In order for emergent mental properties to have causal powers (and thus to exist, according to what Kim has coined “Alexander’s dictum”) there must be some form of mental causation. However, if this is the case, the principle of causal closure is violated and emergence is in danger of becoming an incoherent position. If mental (and therefore downward) causation is denied and thus causal closure retained, emergent properties become merely epiphenomenal and in this case their existence is threatened.

More specifically, the argument is as follows. According to mind-body supervenience, every time a mental property M is instantiated it supervenes on a physical property P. Now suppose M appears to cause another mental property M¹, the question arises whether the cause of M¹ is indeed M or whether it is M¹’s subvenient/subjacent base P¹ (since according to supervenience M¹ is instantiated by a physical property P¹). Given causal exclusion, it cannot be both, and so, given the supervenience relation, it seems that M¹ occurs because P¹ occurred. Therefore, Kim argues, it seems that M actually causes M¹ by causing the subjacent P¹ and that mental to mental (same level) causation presupposes mental to physical (downward) causation. [Another, more direct, way to put this problem is whether the effect of M is really M¹ or M¹’s subjacent base P¹. I chose an alternative formulation in order for the problem to be more clear to the non-expert reader.] However, Kim continues, given causal closure, P¹ must have a sufficient physical cause P. But given exclusion again, P¹ cannot have two sufficient causes, M and P, and so P is the real cause of P¹ because, if M were the real cause then causal closure would be violated again. Therefore, given supervenience, causal closure and causal exclusion, mental properties are merely epiphenomenal. The tension here for the emergentist, the objection goes, is in the double requirement of supervenience and downward causation in that, on the one hand, we have upward determination and the principle of causal closure of the physical domain, and, on the other hand, we have causally efficacious emergent phenomena. In other words, Kim claims that what seem to be cases of emergent causation are just epiphenomena because ultimately the only way to instantiate an emergent property is to instantiate its base. So, saying that higher level properties are causally efficacious renders any form of non-reductive physicalism, under which Kim includes emergentism, at least implausible and at most incoherent.

Note that this is an objection leveled against cases of strong emergence because in cases of weak emergence that do not make any claims of ontological novelty the causal inheritance principle is preserved—the emergents' causal powers are inherited from the powers of their constitutive parts. For example, a flocking pattern of birds may affect the movement of the individual birds in it but that is nothing more than the effect of the aggregate of all the birds that make it up. Also, this argument applies to cases of supervenience-based emergence which retain base properties intact along with emergent properties, but accounts of emergence that are non-synchronic sidestep the problem of downward causation. So, Kim’s objection does not get off the ground as a retort to O’Connor’s dynamical emergence, Bickhard and Campbell’s process model, Silberstein and McGeever’s quantum mechanical emergence or Humphreys’ fusion emergence.

In the cases where this objection applies, there have been different responses.  Philosophers who want to retain causal closure while also retaining emergent properties have tried to give modified accounts of strong emergence that deny either downward causation or the requirement that emergent properties have novel causal powers. For example, Shoemaker (2001) believes that what must be denied is not the principle of causal closure but, instead, that emergent properties have novel causal powers (the appearance of which he elsewhere attributes to “micro-latent” powers of lower-level entities). This approach, however, is problematic, since it seems to be a requirement for robust strong emergence that emergent properties are not merely epiphenomenal. Another approach has recently been proposed by Cynthia and Graham Macdonald (2010) who attempt to preserve causal closure and to show that it is compatible with emergence by building a metaphysics in which events can co-instantiate in a single instance mental and physical properties thus allowing for mental properties to have causal effects (a view that Peter Wyss (2010) has correctly pointed out is in some respects reminiscent of Samuel Alexander’s). In this schema, the Macdonalds argue, property instances do not belong to different levels (though properties do) and so the problem of downward causation is resolved because, in effect, there is no downward causation in the sense assumed by Kim’s argument (and causal efficacy for emergent and mental properties is preserved, they argue, since if a property has causally efficacious instances that means that the property itself has causal powers). However this view will also seem unsatisfactory to the strong emergentist who wants to retain a robust notion of emergent properties and downward causation.

Other philosophers who want to retain strong emergence have opted for rejecting causal closure instead.  Such a line has been taken by Crane (2001), Hendry (2010) and Lowe (2000) who, however, subsequently offers an account of strong emergence compatible with causal closure (Lowe, 2003).

b. Do Cases of Genuine (Strong) Emergence Exist?

Kim’s supervenience argument is meant to question the very possibility of strongly emergent properties. However, even if strong emergence is possible, there is the further question of whether there are any actual cases of strong emergence in the world.

Brian McLaughlin (1992) who grants that the emergence of novel configurational forces is compatible with the laws of physics and that theories of emergence are coherent and consistent, has argued that there is “not a scintilla of evidence” that there are any real cases of strong emergence to be found in the world. This is a commonly cited objection to emergence readily espoused by reductive physicalists committed to the purely physical nature of all the phenomena that have at different times been called emergent and also raised by Mark Bedau who claims that though weak emergence is very common we have no evidence for cases of strong emergence.

Hempel and Oppenheim (1948) have argued that the unpredictability of emergent phenomena is theory-relative—that is, something is emergent only given the knowledge available at a given time—and does not reflect an ontological distinction. And Ernest Nagel (1960), agreeing that emergence is theory-relative, argued that it is a doctrine concerning “logical facts about formal relations between statements rather than any experimental or even ‘metaphysical’ facts about some allegedly ‘inherent’ traits of properties of objects.” According to these views, theoretical advance and accumulation of new knowledge will lead to the re-classification of what are today considered to be emergent phenomena, as happened with the case of life and chemical bonding of the British emergentists. However, though these objections can be construed as viable objections to some forms of weak emergence they fail to affect strong emergence (which was their target) because it is concerned with in principle unpredictability as a result of irreducibility.

Though this skepticism is shared by a few, some philosophers believe that though strong emergence may be rare, it does exist. Bickhard and Campbell (2000), Silvester and McGeever (1999) and Humphreys (1997) claim that ontological emergence can be found (at least) in quantum mechanics—an interesting proposal, and somewhat ironic given that it was advances in quantum physics in the early 20th century that was supposed to have struck the death blow to the British emergentist tradition. Predominantly, however, the usual candidates for strongly emergent properties are mental properties (phenomenal and/or intentional) that continue to resist any kind of reduction. Chalmers (2006)—because of the explanatory gap—considers consciousness to be the only possible intrinsically strongly emergent phenomenon in nature while O’Connor (2000) has argued that our experience of free will which is, in effect, macroscopic control of behavior, seems to be irreducible and hence strongly suggests that human agency may be strongly emergent. (Stephan (2010) also sees free will as a candidate for a strongly emergent property.)

Another line of response is taken by E. J. Lowe (2000) according to whom emergent mental causes could be in principle out of reach of the physiologist, and so it should not come as a surprise that physical science has not discovered them. Lowe argues that, even if we grant that every physical event has a sufficient immediate physical cause, it is plausible that a mental event could have caused the physical event to have that physical cause. That is not to say that the mental event caused the physical event that caused the physical effect; rather, the mental event linked the two physical events so the effect was jointly caused by a mental and a physical event. Such a case, Lowe argues, would be indistinguishable from the point of view of physiological science from a case in which causal closure held.

Following this line of thought it can be argued that though we do not have actual empirical proof that emergent properties exist, the right attitude to hold is to be open to the possibility of their existence. That is, given that there is no available physiological account of how mental states can cause physical states (or how they can be identical), while at the same time having everyday evidence that they do, as well as a plausible mental—psychological or folk psychological—explanation for it, we have independent grounds to believe that emergent properties could possibly exist.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Alexander, Samuel, Space, Time, and Deity. New York: Dover Publications, 1920.
  • Batterman, Robert W., “Emergence in Physics”. Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy Online.
  • Batterman, Robert W., The Devil in the Details: Asymptotic Reasoning in Explanation, Reduction, and Emergence. Oxford Studies in Philosophy of Science. Oxford, UK: Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • Bedau, Mark A. and Humphreys, Paul (eds.), Emergence: Contemporary Readings in Philosophy and Science. London, UK: MIT Press, 2007.
    • A collection of contemporary philosophical and scientific papers on emergence.
  • Bedau, Mark A. “Weak Emergence”, in J. Tomberlin (ed.) Philosophical Perspectives: Mind, Causation and World, vol.11.  Malden, MA: Blackwell, 1997. pp. 375-399.
  • Batterman, Robert W. “Is Weak Emergence Just in the Mind?” Minds and Machines 18, 2008: 443-459.
    • On weak emergence as computational irreducibility and explanatory incompressibility respectively.
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    • On the “process model” of emergence.
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    • The classical formulation of British emergentist tradition.
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    • On “rational emergence,” a form of weak emergence.
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    • On weak and strong emergence.
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    • On the four types of weak emergence that Clark identifies in the cognitive sciences.
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  • Crane, Tim, “The Significance of Emergence” in B. Loewer and G. Gillett (eds) Physicalism and Its Discontents. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
    • On the relation of emergence to non-reductive physicalism, reduction and theexplanatory gap.
  • Hempel, Carl Gustav and Paul Oppenheim (1948), “Studies in the Logic of Explanation”, in Hempel, C. G. Aspects of Scientific Explanation. New York: Free Press, 1965.
    • An exposition of the objection that emergence is only theory relative and not a genuine phenomenon in nature.
  • Humphreys, Paul, “How Properties Emerge.” Philosophy of Science, 1997(a), 64: 1-17.
  • Humphreys, Paul, “Emergence, Not Supervenience.” Philosophy of Science, 1997(b), 64: 337-345.
    • On non-supervenience - based emergence as fusion of properties.
  • Hendry, Robin Findlay, “Emergence vs. Reduction in Chemistry” in Mcdonald & Mcdonald (2010).
    • Contains an argument against causal closure and for downward causation in chemistry in support of the position that emergentism is at least as supported by empirical evidence as non-reductive physicalism.
  • Kim, Jaegwon, “‘Downward Causation’ in Emergentism and Nonreductive Physicalism”, in Beckermann, Flohr, and Kim (eds), Emergence or Reduction? Essays on the Prospects of Nonreductive Physicalism. Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1992.
  • Kim, Jaegwon,“Making Sense of Emergence”. Philosophical Studies, 95, 1999: 3-36.
  • Kim, Jaegwon, Physicalism, or Something Near Enough.  Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press, 2005.
    • Contain analyses of non-reductive physicalism and emergence and a main source of criticism of these views, including the supervenience argument.
  • Lewes, George Henry. Problems of Life and Mind. Vol 2. London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Turbner, & Co., 1875.
      • Another of the historical texts of the British emergentist tradition in which the term “emergent” is coined.
  • Lowe, J., “Causal Closure Principles and Emergentism.” Philosophy, 75 (4), 2000.: 571-585.
  • Lowe, J., “Physical Causal Closure and the Invisibility of Mental Causation” in Sven Walter and Heinz-Dieter Heckmann (eds.) Physicalism and Mental Causation: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action. UK: Imprint Academic, 2003.
    • For an idea of what it could be like for there to be mental forces in principle out of reach of the physiologist yet also consistent with causal closure.
  • Macdonald, C. and G. Macdonald, eds., Emergence in Mind. New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • A collection of philosophical essays on emergence covering a wide range of issues from explanation and reduction to free will and group agency.
  • McLaughlin, Brian P., “Emergence and Supervenience.” Intellectica, 2, 1997: 25-43.
  • McLaughlin, Brian P.,“The Rise and Fall of British Emergentism” in Beckerman, Flor and J.Kim (eds.), Emergence or Reduction? Berlin, Germany: Walter DeGruyter &Co., 1992.
    • The most comprehensive critical historical overview of British emergentism.
  • Mill, J.S., A System of Logic Ratiocinative and Inductive.  London: Longmans, Green and Co., 1930.
    • For Mill’s discussion of homopathic and heteropathic effects and laws that marked the beginning of the British emergentist tradition.
  • Mitchell, Sandra D., Unsimple Truths. Chicago and London: The University of Chicago Press, 2009.
    • A very good account of emergence in science.
  • Morgan, C.L., Emergent Evolution. London: Williams and Norgate, 1923.
  • Nagel, Ernest, The Structure of Science. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1961.
    • On the objection that emergence is only theory relative.
  • Noordhof, Paul, “Emergent Causation and Property Causation” in Emergence in Mind, eds.  Cynthia Macdonald and Graham Macdonald, New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
  • O’Connor, Timothy, “Causality, Mind and Free Will”. Philosophical Perspectives, 14, 2000: 105-117.
  • O’Connor, Timothy, “Emergent Individuals”. The Philosophical Quarterly, 53, 213, 2003: 540-555.
  • O’Connor, Timothy, Emergent Properties”. American Philosophical Quarterly, 31, 1994: 91-104.
  • O’Connor, Timothy,  & Hong Yu Wong, “The Metaphysics of Emergence”. Noûs 39, 4, 2005: 58–678.
    • In defense of strongly emergent properties.
  • Papineau, David, “Why Supervenience?” Analysis, 50, 2 (1990): 66-71.
  • Pepper, Stephen C., “Emergence”. Journal of Philosophy, 23, 1926: 241- 245.
    • The original formulation of the objection against downward causation.
  • Searle, J.R., The Rediscovery of Mind. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1992.
    • Contains a philosophical discussion supporting a weak form of causal emergence for consciousness.
  • Shoemaker, S., “Realization and Mental Causation” in Physicalism and Its Discontents, Barry Loewer and Carl Gillett (eds.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001: 74-98.
  • Silberstein, Michael and John McGeever, “The Search for Ontological Emergence”. The Philosophical Quarterly, 49, 1999: 182-200.
    • An account of strong emergence based on the relational holism of quantum states.
  • Sperry, R. W. “A Modified Concept of Consciousness” Psychological Review, 76, 6, 1969: 532-536
  • Sperry, R.W.  “Mind-Brain Interaction: Mentalism, Yes; Dualism, No”. Neuroscience, 5, 1980: 195-206.
    • An argument for the strong emergence of consciousness involving downward causation from a neuroscientist’s perspective.
  • Stephan, Achim, “Varieties of Emergentism.” Evolution and Cognition, 49, vol. 5, no.1, 1999: 49-59.
    • On different kinds of emergentism and how they relate.
  • Stephan, Achim, “An Emergentist's Perspective on the Problem of Free Will” in Macdonald & Macdonald  (2010).
    • On free will as a strongly emergent property
  • Wimsatt, William C., “Emergence as Non-Aggregativity and the Biases of Reductionisms”. Foundations of Science, 5, 3, 2000: 269-297.
    • On a view of emergence as non-aggregativity that is compatible with reduction.
  • Wyss, Peter, “”Identity with a Difference: Comments on Macdonald and Macdonald in Macdonald & Macdonald  (2010).

Author Information

Elly Vintiadis
Naval Staff and Command College
U. S. A.

The Infinite

Working with the infinite is tricky business. Zeno’s paradoxes first alerted philosophers to this in 450 B.C.E. when he argued that a fast runner such as Achilles has an infinite number of places to reach during the pursuit of a slower runner. Since then, there has been a struggle to understand how to use the notion of infinity in a coherent manner. This article concerns the significant and controversial role that the concepts of infinity and the infinite play in the disciplines of philosophy, physical science, and mathematics.

Philosophers want to know whether there is more than one coherent concept of infinity; which entities and properties are infinitely large, infinitely small, infinitely divisible, and infinitely numerous; and what arguments can justify answers one way or the other.

Here are four suggested examples of these different ways to be infinite. The density of matter at the center of a black hole is infinitely large. An electron is infinitely small. An hour is infinitely divisible. The integers are infinitely numerous. These four claims are ordered from most to least controversial, although all four have been challenged in the philosophical literature.

This article also explores a variety of other questions about the infinite. Is the infinite something indefinite and incomplete, or is it complete and definite? What does Thomas Aquinas mean when he says God is infinitely powerful? Was Gauss, who was one of the greatest mathematicians of all time, correct when he made the controversial remark that scientific theories involve infinities merely as idealizations and merely in order to make for easy applications of those theories, when in fact all physically real entities are finite? How did the invention of set theory change the meaning of the term “infinite”? What did Cantor mean when he said some infinities are smaller than others? Quine said the first three sizes of Cantor’s infinities are the only ones we have reason to believe in. Mathematical Platonists disagree with Quine. Who is correct? We shall see that there are deep connections among all these questions.

Table of Contents

  1. What “Infinity” Means
    1. Actual, Potential, and Transcendental Infinity
    2. The Rise of the Technical Terms
  2. Infinity and the Mind
  3. Infinity in Metaphysics
  4. Infinity in Physical Science
    1. Infinitely Small and Infinitely Divisible
    2. Singularities
    3. Idealization and Approximation
    4. Infinity in Cosmology
  5. Infinity in Mathematics
    1. Infinite Sums
    2. Infinitesimals and Hyperreals
    3. Mathematical Existence
    4. Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory
    5. The Axiom of Choice and the Continuum Hypothesis
  6. Infinity in Deductive Logic
    1. Finite and Infinite Axiomatizability
    2. Infinitely Long Formulas
    3. Infinitely Long Proofs
    4. Infinitely Many Truth Values
    5. Infinite Models
    6. Infinity and Truth
  7. Conclusion
  8. References and Further Reading

1. What “Infinity” Means

The term “the infinite” refers to whatever it is that the word “infinity” correctly applies to. For example, the infinite integers exist just in case there is an infinity of integers. We also speak of infinite quantities, but what does it mean to say a quantity is infinite? In 1851, Bernard Bolzano argued in The Paradoxes of the Infinite that, if a quantity is to be infinite, then the measure of that quantity also must be infinite. Bolzano’s point is that we need a clear concept of infinite number in order to have a clear concept of infinite quantity. This idea of Bolzano’s has led to a new way of speaking about infinity, as we shall see.

The term “infinite” can be used for many purposes. The logician Alfred Tarski used it for dramatic purposes when he spoke about trying to contact his wife in Nazi-occupied Poland in the early 1940s. He complained, “We have been sending each other an infinite number of letters. They all disappear somewhere on the way. As far as I know, my wife has received only one letter.” (Feferman 2004, p. 137) Although the meaning of a term is intimately tied to its use, we can tell only a very little about the meaning of the term from Tarski’s use of it to exaggerate for dramatic effect.

Looking back over the last 2,500 years of use of the term “infinite,” three distinct senses stand out: actually infinite, potentially infinite, and transcendentally infinite. These will be discussed in more detail below, but briefly the concept of potential infinity treats infinity as an unbounded or non-terminating process developing over time. By contrast, the concept of actual infinity treats the infinite as timeless and complete. Transcendental infinity is the least precise of the three concepts and is more commonly used in discussions of metaphysics and theology to suggest transcendence of human understanding or human capability. To give some examples, the set of integers is actually infinite, and so is the number of locations (points of space) between London and Moscow. The maximum length of grammatical sentences in English is potentially infinite, and so is the total amount of memory in a Turing machine, an ideal computer. An omnipotent being’s power is transcendentally infinite.

For purposes of doing mathematics and science, the actual infinite has turned out to be the most useful of the three concepts. Using the idea proposed by Bolzano that was mentioned above, the concept of the actual infinite was precisely defined in 1888 when Richard Dedekind redefined the term “infinity” for use in set theory and Georg Cantor made the infinite, in this sense, an object of mathematical study. Before this turning point, the philosophical community would have said that Aristotle’s concept of potential infinity should be the concept used in mathematics and science.

a. Actual, Potential, and Transcendental Infinity

The Ancient Greeks generally conceived of the infinite as formless, characterless, indefinite, indeterminate, chaotic, and unintelligible. The term had negative connotations and was especially vague, having no clear criteria for distinguishing the finite from the infinite. In his treatment of Zeno’s paradoxes about infinite divisibility, Aristotle (384-322 B.C.E.) made a positive step toward clarification by distinguishing two different concepts of infinity, potential infinity and actual infinity. The latter is also called complete infinity and completed infinity. The actual infinite is not a process in time; it is an infinity that exists wholly at one time. By contrast, Aristotle spoke of the potentially infinite as a never-ending process over time. The word “potential” is being used in a technical sense. A potential swimmer can learn to become an actual swimmer, but a potential infinity cannot become an actual infinity. Aristotle argued that all the problems involving reasoning with infinity are really problems of improperly applying the incoherent concept of actual infinity instead of the coherent concept of potential infinity. (See Aristotle’s Physics, Book III, for his account of infinity.)

For its day, this was a successful way of treating Zeno’s Achilles paradox since, if Zeno had confined himself to using only potential infinity, he would not have been able to develop his paradoxical argument. Here is why. Zeno said that to go from the start to the finish line, the runner must reach the place that is halfway-there, then after arriving at this place he still must reach the place that is half of that remaining distance, and after arriving there he again must reach the new place that is now halfway to the goal, and so on. These are too many places to reach because there is no end to these place since for any one there is another. Zeno made the mistake, according to Aristotle, of supposing that this infinite process needs completing when it really doesn’t; the finitely long path from start to finish exists undivided for the runner, and it is the mathematician who is demanding the completion of such a process. Without that concept of a completed infinite process there is no paradox.

Although today’s standard treatment of the Achilles paradox disagrees with Aristotle and says Zeno was correct to use the concept of a completed infinity and to imply the runner must go to an actual infinity of places in a finite time, Aristotle had so many other intellectual successes that his ideas about infinity dominated the Western world for the next two thousand years.

Even though Aristotle promoted the belief that “the idea of the actual infinite−of that whose infinitude presents itself all at once−was close to a contradiction in terms…,” (Moore 2001, 40) during those two thousand years others did not treat it as a contradiction in terms. Archimedes, Duns Scotus, William of Ockham, Gregory of Rimini, and Leibniz made use of it. Archimedes used it, but had doubts about its legitimacy. Leibniz used it but had doubts about whether it was needed.

Here is an example of how Gregory of Rimini argued in the fourteenth century for the coherence of the concept of actual infinity:

If God can endlessly add a cubic foot to a stone–which He can–then He can create an infinitely big stone. For He need only add one cubic foot at some time, another half an hour later, another a quarter of an hour later than that, and so on ad infinitum. He would then have before Him an infinite stone at the end of the hour. (Moore 2001, 53)

Leibniz envisioned the world as being an actual infinity of mind-like monads, and in (Leibniz 1702) he freely used the concept of being infinitesimally small in his development of the calculus in mathematics.

The term “infinity” that is used in contemporary mathematics and science is based on a technical development of this earlier, informal concept of actual infinity. This technical concept was not created until late in the 19th century.

b. The Rise of the Technical Terms

In the centuries after the decline of ancient Greece, the word “infinite” slowly changed its meaning in Medieval Europe. Theologians promoted the idea that God is infinite because He is limitless, and this at least caused the word “infinity” to lose its negative connotations. Eventually during the Medieval Period, the word had come to mean endless, unlimited, and immeasurable–but not necessarily chaotic. The question of its intelligibility and conceivability by humans was disputed.

Actual infinity is very different. There are actual infinities in the technical, post-1880s sense, which are neither endless, unlimited, nor immeasurable. A line segment one meter long is a good example. It is not endless because it is finitely long, and it is not a process because it is timeless. It is not unlimited because it is limited by both zero and one. It is not immeasurable because its length measure is one meter. Nevertheless, the one meter line is infinite in the technical sense because it has an actual infinity of sub-segments, and it has an actual infinity of distinct points. So, there definitely has been a conceptual revolution.

This can be very shocking to those people who are first introduced to the technical term “actual infinity.” It seems not to be the kind of infinity they are thinking about. The crux of the problem is that these people really are using a different concept of infinity. The sense of infinity in ordinary discourse these days is either the Aristotelian one of potential infinity or the medieval one that requires infinity to be endless, immeasurable, and perhaps to have connotations of perfection, inconceivability, and paradox. This article uses the name transcendental infinity for the medieval concept although there is no generally accepted name for the concept. A transcendental infinity transcends human limits and detailed knowledge; it might be incapable of being described by a precise theory. It might also be a cluster of concepts rather than a single one.

Those people who are surprised when first introduced to the technical term “actual infinity” are probably thinking of either potential infinity or transcendental infinity, and that is why, in any discussion of infinity, some philosophers will say that an appeal to the technical term “actual infinity” is changing the subject. Another reason why there is opposition to actual infinities is that they have so many counter-intuitive properties. For example, consider a continuous line that has an actual infinity of points. A single point on this line has no next point! Also, a one-dimensional continuous curve can fill a two-dimensional area. Equally counterintuitive is the fact that some actually infinite numbers are smaller than other actually infinite numbers. Looked at more optimistically, though, most other philosophers will say the rise of this technical term is yet another example of how the discovery of a new concept has propelled civilization forward.

Resistance to the claim that there are actual infinities has had two other sources. One is the belief that actual infinities cannot be experienced. The second is the belief that use of the concept of actual infinity leads to paradoxes, such as Zeno’s. Because the standard solution to Zeno’s Paradoxes makes use of calculus, the birth of the new technical definition of actual infinity is intimately tied to the development of calculus and thus to properly defining the mathematician’s real line, the linear continuum. Briefly, the reason is that science needs calculus; calculus needs the continuum; the continuum needs a very careful definition; and the best definition requires there to be actual infinities (not merely potential infinities) in the micro-structure and the overall macro-structure of the continuum.

Defining the continuum involves defining real numbers because the linear continuum is the intended model of the theory of real numbers just as the plane is the intended model for the theory of ordinary two-dimensional geometry. It was eventually realized by mathematicians that giving a careful definition to the continuum and to real numbers requires formulating their definitions within set theory. As part of that formulation, mathematicians found a good way to define a rational number in the language of set theory; then they defined a real number to be a certain pair of actually infinite sets of rational numbers. The continuum’s eventual definition required it to be an actually infinite collection whose elements are themselves infinite sets. The details are too complex to be presented here, but the curious reader can check any textbook in classical real analysis. The intuitive picture is that any interval or segment of the continuum is a continuum, and any continuum is a very special infinite set of points that are packed so closely together that there are no gaps. A continuum is perfectly smooth. This smoothness is reflected in there being a great many real numbers between any two real numbers.

Calculus is the area of mathematics that is more applicable to science than any other area. It can be thought of as a technique for treating a continuous change as being composed of an infinite number of infinitesimal changes. When calculus is applied to physical properties capable of change such as spatial location, ocean salinity or an electrical circuit’s voltage, these properties are represented with continuous variables that have real numbers for their values. These values are specific real numbers, not ranges of real numbers and not just rational numbers. Achilles’ location along the path to his goal is such a property.

It took many centuries to rigorously develop the calculus. A very significant step in this direction occurred in 1888 when Richard Dedekind re-defined the term “infinity” and when Georg Cantor used that definition to create the first set theory, a theory that eventually was developed to the point where it could be used for embedding all classical mathematical theories. See the example in the Zeno's Paradoxes article of how Dedekind used set theory and his new idea of "cuts" to define the real numbers in terms of infinite sets of rational numbers. In this way additional rigor was given to the concepts of mathematics, and it encouraged more mathematicians to accept the notion of actually infinite sets. What this embedding requires is first defining the terms of any mathematical theory in the language of set theory, then translating the axioms and theorems of the mathematical theory into sentences of set theory, and then showing that these theorems follow logically from the axioms. (The axioms of any theory, such as set theory, are the special sentences of the theory that can always be assumed during the process of deducing the other theorems of the theory.)

The new technical treatment of infinity that originated with Dedekind in 1888 and adopted by Cantor in his new set theory provided a definition of "infinite set" rather than simply “infinite.” Dedekind says an infinite set is a set that is not finite. The notion of a finite set can be defined in various ways. We might define it numerically as a set having n members, where n is some non-negative integer. Dedekind found an essentially equivalent definition of finite set (assuming the axiom of choice, which will be discussed later), but Dedekind’s definition does not require mentioning numbers:

A (Dedekind) finite set is a set for which there exists no one-to-one correspondence between it and one of its proper subsets.

By placing the finger-tips of your left hand on the corresponding finger-tips of your right hand, you establish a one-to-one correspondence between the set of fingers of each hand; in that way you establish that there are the same number of fingers on each of your hands, without your needing to count the fingers. More generally, there is a one-to-one correspondence between two sets when each member of one set can be paired off with a unique member of the other set, so that neither set has an unpaired member.

Here is a one-to-one correspondence between the natural numbers and the even, positive numbers:

1, 2, 3, 4, ...

↕   ↕   ↕  ↕

2, 4, 6, 8, ...

Informally expressed, any infinite set can be matched up to a part of itself; so the whole is equivalent to a part. This is a surprising definition because, before this definition was adopted, the idea that actually infinite wholes are equinumerous with some of their parts was taken as clear evidence that the concept of actual infinity is inherently paradoxical. For a systematic presentation of the many alternative ways to successfully define “infinite set” non-numerically, see (Tarski 1924).

Dedekind’s new definition of "infinite" is defining an actually infinite set, not a potentially infinite set because Dedekind appealed to no continuing operation over time. The concept of a potentially infinite set is then given a new technical definition by saying a potentially infinite set is a growing, finite subset of an actually infinite set. Cantor expressed the point this way:

In order for there to be a variable quantity in some mathematical study, the “domain” of its variability must strictly speaking be known beforehand through a definition. However, this domain cannot itself be something variable…. Thus this “domain” is a definite, actually infinite set of values. Thus each potential infinite…presupposes an actual infinite. (Cantor 1887)

The new idea is that the potentially infinite set presupposes an actually infinite one. If this is correct, then Aristotle’s two notions of the potential infinite and actual infinite have been redefined and clarified.

Two sets are the same if any member of one is a member of the other, and vice versa. Order of the members is irrelevant to the identity of the set, and to the size of the set. Two sets are the same size if there exists a one-to-one correspondence between them. This definition of same size was recommended by both Cantor and Frege. Cantor defined “finite” by saying a set is finite if it is in one-to-one correspondence with the set {1, 2, 3, …, n} for some positive integer n; and he said a set is infinite if it is not finite.

Cardinal numbers are measures of the sizes of sets. There are many definitions of what a cardinal number is, but what is essential for cardinal numbers is that two sets have the same cardinal just in case there is a one-to-one correspondence between them; and set A has a smaller cardinal number than a set B (and so set A has fewer members than B) provided there is a one-to-one correspondence between A and a subset of B, but B is not the same size as A. In this sense, the set of even integers does not have fewer members than the set of all integers, although intuitively you might think it does.

How big is infinity? This question does not make sense for either potential infinity or transcendental infinity, but it does for actual infinity. Finite cardinal numbers such as 0, 1, 2, and 3 are measures of the sizes of finite sets, and transfinite cardinal numbers are measures of the sizes of actually infinite sets. The transfinite cardinals are aleph-null, aleph-one, aleph-two, and so on, which we represent with the numerals ℵ0, ℵ1, ℵ2, .... The smallest infinite size is ℵ0 which is the size of the set of natural numbers, and it is called a countable infinity; the other alephs are measures of the uncountable infinities. However, these are somewhat misleading terms since no process of counting is involved. Nobody would have the time to count from 0 to any aleph.

The set of even integers, the set of natural numbers and the set of rational numbers all can be shown to have the same size, but surprisingly they all are smaller than the set of real numbers. Any set of size ℵ0 is said to be countably infinite (or denumerably infinite or enumerably infinite). The set of points in the continuum and in any interval of the continuum turns out to be larger than ℵ0, although how much larger is still an open problem, called the continuum problem. A popular but controversial suggestion is that a continuum is of size ℵ1, the next larger size.

When creating set theory, mathematicians did not begin with the belief that there would be so many points between any two points in the continuum nor with the belief that for any infinite cardinal there is a larger cardinal. These were surprising consequences discovered by Cantor. To many philosophers, this surprise is evidence that what is going on is not invention but rather is discovery about a mind-independent reality.

The intellectual community has always been wary of actually infinite sets. Before the discovery of how to embed calculus within set theory (a process that is also called giving calculus a basis in set theory), it could have been more easily argued that science does not need actual infinities. The burden of proof has now shifted, and the default position is that actual infinites are indispensable in mathematics and science, and anyone who wants to do without them must show that removing them does not do too much damage and has additional benefits. There are no known successful attempts to reconstruct the theories of mathematical physics without basing them on mathematical objects such as numbers and sets, but for one attempt to do so using second-order logic, see (Field 1980).

Here is why some mathematicians believe the set-theoretic basis is so important:

Just as chemistry was unified and simplified when it was realized that every chemical compound is made of atoms, mathematics was dramatically unified when it was realized that every object of mathematics can be taken to be the same kind of thing. There are now other ways than set theory to unify mathematics, but before set theory there was no such unifying concept. Indeed, in the Renaissance, mathematicians hesitated to add x2 to x3, since the one was an area and the other a volume. Since the advent of set theory, one can correctly say that all mathematicians are exploring the same mental universe. (Rucker 1982, p. 64)

But the significance of this basis can be exaggerated. The existence of the basis does not imply that mathematics is set theory.

However, paradoxes soon were revealed within set theory, by Cantor himself and then others, so the quest for a more rigorous definition of the mathematical continuum continued. Cantor’s own paradox surfaced in 1895 when he asked whether the set of all cardinal numbers has a cardinal number. Cantor showed that, if it does, then it doesn’t. Surely the set of all sets would have the greatest cardinal number, but Cantor showed that for any cardinal number there is a greater cardinal number.  [For more details about this and the other paradoxes, see (Suppes 1960).] The most famous paradox of set theory is Russell’s Paradox of 1901. He showed that the set of all sets that are not members of themselves is both a member of itself and not a member of itself. Russell wrote that the paradox “put an end to the logical honeymoon that I had been enjoying.”

These and other paradoxes were eventually resolved satisfactorily by finding revised axioms of set theory that permit the existence of enough well-behaved sets so that set theory is not crippled [that is, made incapable of providing a basis for mathematical theories] and yet the axioms do not permit the existence of too many sets, the ill-behaved sets such as Cantor’s set of all cardinals and Russell’s set of all sets that are not members of themselves. Finally, by the mid-20th century, it had become clear that, despite the existence of competing set theories, Zermelo-Fraenkel’s set theory (ZF) was the best way or the least radical way to revise set theory in order to avoid all the known paradoxes and problems while at the same time preserving enough of our intuitive ideas about sets that it deserved to be called a set theory, and at this time most mathematicians would have agreed that the continuum had been given a proper basis in ZF. See (Kleene 1967, pp. 189-191) for comments on this agreement about ZF’s success and for a list of the ZF axioms and for a detailed explanation of why each axiom deserves to be an axiom.

Because of this success, and because it was clear enough that the concept of infinity used in ZF does not lead to contradictions, and because it seemed so evident how to use the concept in other areas of mathematics and science where the term “infinity” was being used, the definition of the concept of "infinite set" within ZF was claimed by many philosophers to be the paradigm example of how to provide a precise and fruitful definition of a philosophically significant concept. Much less attention was then paid to critics who had complained that we can never use the word “infinity” coherently because infinity is ineffable or inherently paradoxical.

Nevertheless there was, and still is, serious philosophical opposition to actually infinite sets and to ZF's treatment of the continuum, and this has spawned the programs of constructivism, intuitionism, finitism and ultrafinitism, all of whose advocates have philosophical objections to actual infinities. Even though there is much to be said in favor of replacing a murky concept with a clearer, technical concept, there is always the worry that the replacement is a change of subject that hasn’t really solved the problems it was designed for. This discussion of the role of infinity in mathematics and science continues in later sections of this article.

2. Infinity and the Mind

Can humans grasp the concept of the infinite? This seems to be a profound question. Ever since Zeno, intellectuals have realized that careless reasoning about infinity can lead to paradox and perhaps “defeat” the human mind. Some critics of infinity argue that paradox is essential to, or inherent in, the use of the concept of infinity, so the infinite is beyond the grasp of the human mind. However, this criticism applies more properly to some forms of transcendental infinity rather than to either actual infinity or potential infinity.

A second reason to believe humans cannot grasp infinity is that the concept must contain an infinite number of parts or sub-ideas. A counter to this reason is to defend the psychological claim that if a person succeeds in thinking about infinity, it does not follow that the person needs to have an actually infinite number of ideas in mind at one time.

A third reason to believe the concept of infinity is beyond human understanding is that to have the concept one must have some accurate mental picture of infinity. Thomas Hobbes, who believed that all thinking is based on imagination, might remark that nobody could picture an infinite number of grains of sand at once. However, most contemporary philosophers of psychology believe mental pictures are not essential to having any concept. Regarding the concept of dog, you might have a picture of a brown dog in your mind and I might have a picture of a black dog in mine, but I can still understand you perfectly well when you say dogs frequently chase cats.

The main issue here is whether we can coherently think about infinity to the extent of being said to have the concept. Here is a simple argument that we can: If we understand negation and have the concept of finite, then the concept of infinite is merely the concept of not-finite. A second argument says the apparent consistency of set theory indicates that infinity in the technical sense of actual infinity is well within our grasp. And since potential infinity is definable in terms of actual infinity, it, too, is within our grasp.

Assuming that infinity is within our grasp, what is it that we are grasping? Philosophers disagree on the answer. In 1883, Cantor said

A set is a Many which allows itself to be thought of as a One.

Notice the dependence on thought. Cantor eventually clarified what he meant and was clear that he did not want set existence to depend on mental capability. What he really believed is that a set is a collection of well-defined and distinct objects that exists independently of being thought of, but that could be thought of by a powerful enough mind.

3. Infinity in Metaphysics

There is a concept which corrupts and upsets all others. I refer not to Evil, whose limited realm is that of ethics; I refer to the infinite. —Jorge Luis Borges.

Shakespeare declared, “The will is infinite.” Is he correct or just exaggerating? Critics of Shakespeare, interpreted literally, might argue that the will is basically a product of different brain states. Because a person’s brain contains approximately 1027 atoms, these have only a finite number of configurations or states, and so, regardless of whether we interpret Shakespeare’s remark as implying that the will is unbounded (is potentially infinite) or the will produces an infinite number of brain states (is actually infinite), the will is not infinite. But perhaps Shakespeare was speaking metaphorically and did not intend to be taken literally, or perhaps he meant to use some version of transcendental infinity that makes infinity be somehow beyond human comprehension.

Contemporary Continental philosophers often speak that way. Emmanuel Levinas says the infinite is another name for the Other, for the existence of other conscious beings besides ourselves whom we are ethically responsible for. We “face the infinite” in the sense of facing a practically incomprehensible and unlimited number of possibilities upon encountering another conscious being. (See Levinas 1961.) If we ask what sense of “infinite” is being used by Levinas, it may be yet another concept of infinity, or it may be some kind of transcendental infinity. Another interpretation is that he is exaggerating about the number of possibilities and should say instead that there are too many possibilities to be faced when we encounter another conscious being and that the possibilities are not readily predictable because other conscious beings make free choices, the causes of which often are not known even to the person making the choice.

Leibniz was one of the few persons in earlier centuries who believed in actually infinite sets, but he did not believe in infinite numbers. Cantor did. Referring to his own discovery of the transfinite cardinals ℵ0, ℵ1, ℵ2, .... and their properties, Cantor claimed his work was revealing God’s existence and that these mathematical objects were in the mind of God. He claimed God gave humans the concept of the infinite so that they could reflect on His perfection. Influential German neo-Thomists such as Constantin Gutberlet agreed with Cantor. Some Jesuit math instructors claim that by taking a calculus course and understanding infinity, students are getting closer to God. Their critics complain that these mystical ideas about infinity and God are too speculative.

When metaphysicians speak of infinity they use all three concepts: potential infinity, actual infinity, and transcendental infinity. But when they speak about God being infinite, they are usually interested in implying that God is beyond human understanding or that there is a lack of a limit on particular properties of God, such as God's goodness and knowledge and power.

The connection between infinity and God exists in nearly all of the world’s religions. It is prominent in Hindu, Muslim, Jewish, and Christian literature. For example, in chapter 11 of the Bhagavad Gita of Hindu scripture, Krishna says, “O Lord of the universe, I see You everywhere with infinite form....”

Plato did not envision God (the Demi-urge) as infinite because he viewed God as perfect, and he believed anything perfect must be limited and thus not infinite because the infinite was defined as an unlimited, unbounded, indefinite, unintelligible chaos.

But the meaning of the term “infinite” slowly began to change. Over six hundred years later, the Neo-Platonist philosopher Plotinus was one of the first important Greek philosophers to equate God with the infinite−although he did not do so explicitly. He said instead that any idea abstracted from our finite experience is not applicable to God. He probably believed that if God were finite in some aspect, then there could be something beyond God and therefore God wouldn’t be “the One.” Plotinus was influential in helping remove the negative connotations that had accompanied the concept of the infinite. One difficulty here, though, is that it is unclear whether metaphysicians have discovered that God is identical with the transcendentally infinite or whether they are simply defining “God” to be that way. A more severe criticism is that perhaps they are just defining “infinite” (in the transcendental sense) as whatever God is.

Augustine, who merged Platonic philosophy with the Christian religion, spoke of God “whose understanding is infinite” for “what are we mean wretches that dare presume to limit His knowledge?” Augustine wrote that the reason God can understand the infinite is that “...every infinity is, in a way we cannot express, made finite to God....” [City of God, Book XII, ch. 18] This is an interesting perspective. Medieval philosophers debated whether God could understand infinite concepts other than Himself, not because God had limited understanding, but because there was no such thing as infinity anywhere except in God.

The medieval philosopher Thomas Aquinas, too, said God has infinite knowledge. He definitely did not mean potentially infinite knowledge. The technical definition of actual infinity might be useful here. If God is infinitely knowledgeable, this can be understood perhaps as meaning that God knows the truth values of all declarative sentences and that the set of these sentences is actually infinite.

Aquinas argued in his Summa Theologia that, although God created everything, nothing created by God can be actually infinite. His main reason was that anything created can be counted, yet if an infinity were created, then the count would be infinite, but no infinite numbers exist to do the counting (as Aristotle had also said). In his day this was a better argument than today because Cantor created (or discovered) infinite numbers in the late 19th century.

René Descartes believed God was actually infinite, and he remarked that the concept of actual infinity is so awesome that no human could have created it or deduced it from other concepts, so any idea of infinity that humans have must have come from God directly. Thus God exists. Descartes is using the concept of infinity to produce a new ontological argument for God’s existence.

David Hume, and many other philosophers, raised the problem that if God has infinite power then there need not be evil in the world, and if God has infinite goodness, then there should not be any evil in the world. This problem is often referred to as "The Problem of Evil" and has been a long standing point of contention for theologians.

Spinoza and Hegel envisioned God, or the Absolute, pantheistically. If they are correct, then to call God infinite, is to call the world itself infinite. Hegel denigrated Aristotle’s advocacy of potential infinity and claimed the world is actually infinite. Traditional Christian, Muslim and Jewish metaphysicians do not accept the pantheistic notion that God is at one with the world. Instead they say God transcends the world. Since God is outside space and time, the space and time that he created may or may not be infinite, depending on God’s choice, but surely everything else he created is finite, they say.

The multiverse theories of cosmology in the early 21st century allow there to be an uncountable infinity of universes within a background space whose volume is actually infinite. The universe created by our Big Bang is just one of these many universes. Christian theologians balk at the notion of God choosing to create this multiverse because the theory implies that, although there are so many universes radically different from ours, there also are an actually infinite number of copies of ours, which implies there are an infinite number of Jesuses who have been crucified on the cross. The removal of the uniqueness of Jesus is apparently a removal of his dignity. Augustine had this worry when considering infinite universes, and he responded that "Christ died once for sinners...."

There are many other entities and properties that some metaphysician or other has claimed are infinite: places, possibilities, propositions, properties, particulars, partial orderings, pi’s decimal expansion, predicates, proofs, Plato’s forms, principles, power sets, probabilities, positions, and possible worlds. That is just for the letter p. Some of these are considered to be abstract objects, objects outside of space and time, and others are considered to be concrete objects, objects within, or part of, space and time.

For helpful surveys of the history of infinity in theology and metaphysics, see (Owen 1967) and (Moore 2001).

4. Infinity in Physical Science

From a metaphysical perspective, the theories of mathematical physics seem to be ontologically committed to objects and their properties. If any of those objects or properties are infinite, then physics is committed to there being infinity within the physical world.

Here are four suggested examples where infinity occurs within physical science. (1) Standard cosmology based on Einstein’s general theory of relativity implies the density of the mass at the center of a simple black hole is infinitely large (even though black hole’s total mass is finite). (2) The Standard Model of particle physics implies the size of an electron is infinitely small. (3) General relativity implies that every path in space is infinity divisible. (4) Classical quantum theory implies the values of kinetic energy of an accelerating, free electron are infinitely numerous. These four kinds of infinities—infinite large, infinitely small, infinitely divisible, and infinitely numerous—are implied by theory and argumentation, and are not something that could be measured directly.

Objecting to taking scientific theories at face value, the 18th century British empiricists George Berkeley and David Hume denied the physical reality of even potential infinities on the empiricist grounds that such infinities are not detectable by our sense organs. Most philosophers of the 21st century would say that Berkeley’s and Hume’s empirical standards are too rigid because they are based on the mistaken assumption that our knowledge of reality must be a complex built up from simple impressions gained from our sense organs.

But in the spirit of Berkeley and Hume’s empiricism, instrumentalists also challenge any claim that science tells us the truth about physical infinities. The instrumentalists say that all theories of science are merely effective “instruments” designed for explanatory and predictive success. A scientific theory’s claims are neither true nor false. By analogy, a shovel is an effective instrument for digging, but a shovel is neither true nor false. The instrumentalist would say our theories of mathematical physics imply only that reality looks “as if” there are physical infinities. Some realists on this issue respond that to declare it to be merely a useful mathematical fiction that there are physical infinities is just as misleading as to say it is a mere fiction that moving planets actually have inertia or petunias actually contain electrons. We have no other tool than theory-building for accessing the existing features of reality that are not directly perceptible. If our best theories—those that have been well tested and are empirically successful and make novel predictions—use theoretical terms that refer to infinities, then infinities must be accepted. See (Leplin 2000) for more details about anti-realist arguments, such as those of instrumentalism and constructive empiricism.

a. Infinitely Small and Infinitely Divisible

Consider the size of electrons and quarks, the two main components of atoms. All scientific experiments so far have been consistent with electrons and quarks having no internal structure (components), as our best scientific theories imply, so the "simple conclusion" is that electrons are infinitely small, or infinitesimal, and zero-dimensional. Is this “simple conclusion” too simple? Some physicists speculate that there are no physical particles this small and that, in each subsequent century, physicists will discover that all the particles of the previous century have a finite size due to some inner structure. However, most physicists withhold judgment on this point about the future of physics.

A second reason to question whether the “simple conclusion” is too simple is that electrons, quarks, and all other elementary particles behave in a quantum mechanical way. They have a wave nature as well as a particle nature, and they have these simultaneously. When probing an electron’s particle nature it is found to have no limit to how small it can be, but when probing the electron’s wave nature, the electron is found to be spread out through all of space, although it is more probably in some places than others. Also, quantum theory is about groups of objects, not a single object. The theory does not imply a definite result for a single observation but only for averages over many observations, so this is why quantum theory introduces an inescapable randomness or unpredictability into claims about single objects and single experimental results. The more accurate theory of quantum electrodynamics (QED) that incorporates special relativity and improves on classical quantum theory for the smallest regions, also implies electrons are infinitesimal particles when viewed as particles, while they are wavelike or spread out when viewed as waves. When considering the electron’s particle nature, QED’s prediction of zero volume has been experimentally verified down to the limits of measurement technology. The measurement process is limited by the fact that light or other electromagnetic radiation must be used to locate the electron, and this light cannot be used to determine the position of the electron more accurately than the distance between the wave crests of the light wave used to bombard the electron. So, all this is why the “simple conclusion” mentioned at the beginning of this paragraph may be too simple. For more discussion, see the chapter “The Uncertainty Principle” in (Hawking 2001) or (Greene 1999, pp. 121-2).

If a scientific theory implies space is a continuum, with the structure of a mathematical continuum, then if that theory is taken at face value, space is infinitely divisible and composed of infinitely small entities, the so-called points of space. But should it be taken at face value? The mathematician David Hilbert declared in 1925, “A homogeneous continuum which admits of the sort of divisibility needed to realize the infinitely small is nowhere to be found in reality. The infinite divisibility of a continuum is an operation which exists only in thought.” Many physicists agree with Hilbert, but many others argue that, although Hilbert is correct that ordinary entities such as strawberries and cream are not continuous, he is ultimately incorrect, for the following reasons.

First, the Standard Model of particles and forces is one of the best tested and most successful theories in all the history of physics. So are the theories of relativity and quantum mechanics. All these theories imply or assume that, using Cantor’s technical sense of actual infinity, there are infinitely many infinitesimal instants in any non-zero duration, and there are infinitely many point places along any spatial path. So, time is a continuum, and space is a continuum.

The second challenge to Hilbert’s position is that quantum theory, in agreement with relativity theory, implies that for any possible kinetic energy of a free electron there is half that energy−insofar as an electron can be said to have a value of energy independent of being measured to have it. Although the energy of an electron bound within an atom is quantized, the energy of an unbound or free electron is not. If it accelerates in its reference frame from zero to nearly the speed of light, its energy changes and takes on all intermediate real-numbered values from its rest energy to its total energy. But mass is just a form of energy, as Einstein showed in his famous equation E = mc2, so in this sense mass is a continuum as well as energy.

How about non-classical quantum mechanics, the proposed theories of quantum gravity that are designed to remove the disagreements between quantum mechanics and relativity theory? Do these non-classical theories quantize all these continua we’ve been talking about? One such theory, the theory of loop quantum gravity, implies space consists of discrete units called loops. But string theory, which is the more popular of the theories of quantum gravity in the early 21st century, does not imply space is discontinuous. [See (Greene 2004) for more details.] Speaking about this question of continuity, the theoretical physicist Brian Greene says that, although string theory is developed against a background of continuous spacetime, his own insight is that

[T]he increasingly intense quantum jitters that arise on decreasing scales suggest that the notion of being able to divide distances or durations into ever smaller units likely comes to an end at around the Planck length (10-33centimeters) and Planck time (10-43 seconds). ...There is something lurking in the microdepths−something that might be called the bare-bones substrate of spacetime−the entity to which the familiar notion of spacetime alludes. We expect that this ur-ingredient, this most elemental spacetime stuff, does not allow dissection into ever smaller pieces because of the violent fluctuations that would ultimately be encountered.... [If] familiar spacetime is but a large-scale manifestation of some more fundamental entity, what is that entity and what are its essential properties? As of today, no one knows. (Greene 2004, pp. 473, 474, 477)

Disagreeing, the theoretical physicist Roger Penrose speaks about both loop quantum gravity and string theory and says: the early days of quantum mechanics, there was a great hope, not realized by future developments, that quantum theory was leading physics to a picture of the world in which there is actually discreteness at the tiniest levels. In the successful theories of our present day, as things have turned out, we take spacetime as a continuum even when quantum concepts are involved, and ideas that involve small-scale spacetime discreteness must be regarded as ‘unconventional.’ The continuum still features in an essential way even in those theories which attempt to apply the ideas of quantum mechanics to the very structure of space and time.... Thus it appears, for the time being at least, that we need to take the use of the infinite seriously, particular in its role in the mathematical description of the physical continuum. (Penrose 2005, 363)

b. Singularities

There is a good reason why scientists fear the infinite more than mathematicians do. Scientists have to worry that some day we will have a dangerous encounter with a singularity, with something that is, say, infinitely hot or infinitely dense. For example, we might encounter a singularity by being sucked into a black hole. According to Schwarzschild’s solution to the equations of general relativity, a simple, non-rotating black hole is infinitely dense at its center. For a second example of where there may be singularities, there is good reason to believe that 13.8 billion years ago the entire universe was a singularity with infinite temperature, infinite density, infinitesimal volume, and infinite curvature of spacetime.

Some philosophers will ask: Is it not proper to appeal to our best physical theories in order to learn what is physically possible? Usually, but not in this case, say many scientists, including Albert Einstein. He believed that, if a theory implies that some physical properties might have or, worse yet, do have actually infinite values (the so-called singularities), then this is a sure sign of error in the theory. It’s an error primarily because the theory will be unable to predict the behavior of the infinite entity, and so the theory will fail. For example, even if there were a large, shrinking universe pre-existing the Big Bang, if the Big Bang were considered to be an actual singularity, then knowledge of the state of the universe before the Big Bang could not be used to predict events after the Big Bang, or vice versa. This failure to imply the character of later states of the universe is what Einstein’s collaborator Peter Bergmann meant when he said, “A theory that involves singularities...carries within itself the seeds of its own destruction.” The majority of physicists probably would agree with Einstein and Bergmann about this, but the critics of these scientists say this belief that we need to remove singularities everywhere is merely a hope that has been turned into a metaphysical assumption.

But doesn’t quantum theory also rule out singularities? Yes. Quantum theory allows only arbitrary large, finite values of properties such as temperature and mass-energy density. So which theory, relativity theory or quantum theory, should we trust to tell us whether the center of a black hole is or isn’t a singularity? The best answer is, “Neither, because we should get our answer from a theory of quantum gravity.” A principal attraction of string theory, a leading proposal for a theory of quantum gravity to replace both relativity theory and quantum theory, is that it eliminates the many singularities that appear in previously accepted physical theories such as relativity theory. In string theory, the electrons and quarks are not point particles but are small, finite loops of fundamental string. That finiteness in the loop is what eliminates the singularities.

Unfortunately, string theory has its own problems with infinity. It implies an infinity of kinds of particles. If a particle is a string, then the energy of the particle should be the energy of its vibrating string. Strings have an infinite number of possible vibrational patterns each corresponding to a particle that should exist if we take the theory literally. One response that string theorists make to this problem about too many particles is that perhaps the infinity of particles did exist at the time of the Big Bang but now they have all disintegrated into a shower of simpler particles and so do not exist today. Another response favored by string theorists is that perhaps there never were an infinity of particles nor a Big Bang singularity in the first place. Instead the Big Bang was a Big Bounce or quick expansion from a pre-existing, shrinking universe whose size stopped shrinking when it got below the critical Planck length of about 10-35 meters.

c. Idealization and Approximation

Scientific theories use idealization and approximation; they are "lies that help us to see the truth," to use a phrase from the painter Pablo Picasso (who was speaking about art, not science). In our scientific theories, there are ideal gases, perfectly elliptical orbits, and economic consumers motivated only by profit. Everybody knows these are not intended to be real objects. Yet, it is clear that idealizations and approximations are actually needed in science in order to promote genuine explanation of many phenomena. We need to reduce the noise of the details in order to see what is important. In short, approximations and idealizations can be explanatory. But what about approximations and idealizations that involve the infinite?

Although the terms “idealization” and “approximation” are often used interchangeably, John Norton (Norton 2012) recommends paying more attention to their difference by saying that, when there is some aspect of the world, some target system, that we are trying to understand scientifically, approximations should be considered to be inexact descriptions of the target system whereas idealizations should be considered to be new systems or parts of new systems that also are approximations to the target system but that contain reference to some novel object or property. For example, elliptical orbits are approximations to actual orbits of planets, but ideal gases are idealizations because they contain novel objects such as point particles that are part of a new system that is useful for approximating the target system of actual gases.

All very detailed physical theories are idealizations or approximations to reality that can fail if pushed too far, but some defenders of infinity ask whether all appeals to infinity can be known a priori to be idealizations or approximations. Our theory of the solar system justifies our belief that the Earth is orbited by a moon, not just an approximate moon. The speed of light in a vacuum really is constant, not just approximately constant. Why then should it be assumed, as it often is, that all appeals to infinity in scientific theory are approximations or idealizations? Must the infinity be an artifact of the model rather than a feature of actual physical reality?  Philosophers of science disagree on this issue. See (Mundy, 1990, p. 290).

There is an argument for believing some appeals to infinity definitely are neither approximations nor idealizations. The argument presupposes a realist rather than an antirealist understanding of science, and it begins with a description of the opponents’ position. Carl Friedrich Gauss (1777-1855) was one of the greatest mathematicians of all time. He said scientific theories involve infinities merely as approximations or idealizations and merely in order to make for easy applications of those theories, when in fact all real entities are finite. At the time, nearly everyone would have agreed with Gauss. Roger Penrose argues against Gauss’ position:

Nevertheless, as tried and tested physical theory stands today—as it has for the past 24 centuries—real numbers still form a fundamental ingredient of our understanding of the physical world. (Penrose 2004, 62)

Gauss’ position could be buttressed if there were useful alternatives to our physical theories that do not use infinities. There actually are alternative mathematical theories of analysis that do not use real numbers and do not use infinite sets and do not require the line to be dense. See (Ahmavaara 1965) for an example. Representing the majority position among scientists on this issue, Penrose says, “To my mind, a physical theory which depends fundamentally upon some absurdly enormous...number would be a far more complicated (and improbable) theory than one that is able to depend upon a simple notion of infinity” (Penrose 2005, 359). David Deutsch agrees. He says, “Versions of number theory that confined themselves to ‘small natural numbers’ would have to be so full of arbitrary qualifiers, workarounds and unanswered questions, that they would be very bad explanations until they were generalized to the case that makes sense without such ad-hoc restrictions: the infinite case.” (Deutsch 2011, pp. 118-9) And surely a successful explanation is the surest route to understanding reality.

In opposition to this position of Penrose and Deutsch, and in support of Gauss’ position, the physicist Erwin Schrödinger remarks, “The idea of a continuous range, so familiar to mathematicians in our days, is something quite exorbitant, an enormous extrapolation of what is accessible to us.” Emphasizing this point about being “accessible to us,” some metaphysicians attack the applicability of the mathematical continuum to physical reality on the grounds that a continuous human perception over time is not mathematically continuous. Wesley Salmon responds to this complaint from Schrödinger:

...The perceptual continuum and perceived becoming [that is, the evidence from our sense organs that the world changes from time to time] exhibit a structure radically different from that of the mathematical continuum. Experience does seem, as James and Whitehead emphasize, to have an atomistic character. If physical change could be understood only in terms of the structure of the perceptual continuum, then the mathematical continuum would be incapable of providing an adequate description of physical processes. In particular, if we set the epistemological requirement that physical continuity must be constructed from physical points which are explicitly definable in terms of observables, then it will be impossible to endow the physical continuum with the properties of the mathematical continuum. In our discussion..., we shall see, however, that no such rigid requirement needs to be imposed. (Salmon 1970, 20)

Salmon continues by making the point that calculus provides better explanations of physical change than explanations which accept the “rigid requirement” of understanding physical change in terms of the structure of the perceptual continuum, so he recommends that we apply Ockham’s Razor and eliminate that rigid requirement. But the issue is not settled.

d. Infinity in Cosmology

Let’s review some of the history regarding the volume of spacetime. Aristotle said the past is infinite because, for any past time we can imagine an earlier one. It is difficult to make sense of his belief about the past since he means it is potentially infinite. After all, the past has an end, namely the present, so its infinity has been completed and therefore is not a potential infinity. This problem with Aristotle’s reasoning was first raised in the 13th century by Richard Rufus of Cornwall. It was not given the attention it deserved because of the assumption for so many centuries that Aristotle couldn’t have been wrong about time, especially since his position was consistent with Christian, Jewish, and Muslim theology which implies the physical world became coherent or well-formed only a finite time ago. However Aquinas argued against Aristotle’s view that the past is infinite; Aquinas’ grounds were that Holy Scripture implies God created the world a finite time ago, and that Aristotle was wrong to put so much trust in what we can imagine.

Unlike time, Aristotle claimed space is finite. He said the volume of physical space is finite because it is enclosed within a finite, spherical shell of visible, fixed stars with the Earth at its center. On this topic of space not being infinite, Aristotle’s influence was authoritative to most scholars for the next eighteen hundred years.

The debate about whether the volume of space is infinite was rekindled in Renaissance Europe. The English astronomer and defender of Copernicus, Thomas Digges (1546–1595) was the first scientist to reject the ancient idea of an outer spherical shell and to declare that physical space is actually infinite in volume and filled with stars. The physicist Isaac Newton (1642–1727) at first believed the universe's material is confined to only a finite region while it is surrounded by infinite empty space, but in 1691 he realized that if there were a finite number of stars in a finite region, then gravity would require all the stars to fall in together at some central point. To avoid this result, he later speculated that the universe contains an infinite number of stars in an infinite volume. The notion of infinite time, however, was not accepted by Newton because of conflict with Christian orthodoxy, as influenced by Aquinas. We now know that Newton’s speculation about the stability of an infinity of stars in an infinite universe is incorrect. There would still be clumping so long as the universe did not expand. (Hawking 2001, p. 9)

Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) declared that space and time are both potentially infinite in extent because this is imposed by our own minds. Space and time are not features of “things in themselves” but are an aspect of the very form of any possible human experience, he said. We can know a priori even more about space than about time, he believed; and he declared that the geometry of space must be Euclidean. Kant’s approach to space and time as something knowable a priori went out of fashion in the early 20th century. It was undermined in large part by the discovery of non-Euclidean geometries in the 19th century, then by Beltrami’s and Klein’s proofs that these geometries are as logically consistent as Euclidean geometry, and finally by Einstein’s successful application to physical space of non-Euclidean geometry within his general theory of relativity.

The volume of spacetime is finite at present if we can trust the classical Big Bang theory. [But do not think of this finite space as having a boundary beyond which a traveler falls over the edge into nothingness, or a boundary that cannot be penetrated.] Assuming space is all the places that have been created since the Big Bang, then the volume of space is definitely finite at present, though it is huge and growing ever larger over time. Assuming this expansion will never stop, it follows that the volume of spacetime is potentially infinite but not actually infinite. However, if, as some theorists speculate on the basis of inflationary cosmology, everything that is a product of our Big Bang is just one “bubble” in a sea of bubbles in the infinite spacetime background of the Multiverse, then both space and time are actually infinite. For more discussion of the issue of the infinite volume of spacetime, see (Greene 2011).

In the late nineteenth century, Georg Cantor argued that the mathematical concept of potential infinity presupposes the mathematical concept of actual infinity. This argument was accepted by most later mathematicians, but it does not imply that, if future time were to be potentially infinite, then future time also would be actually infinite.

5. Infinity in Mathematics

The previous sections of this article have introduced the concepts of actual infinity and potential infinity and explored the development of calculus and set theory, but this section will probe deeper into the role of infinity in mathematics. Mathematicians always have been aware of the special difficulty in dealing with the concept of infinity in a coherent manner. Intuitively, it seems reasonable that if we have two infinities of things, then we still have an infinity of them. So, we might represent this intuition mathematically by the equation 2 ∞ = 1 ∞. Dividing both sides by ∞ will prove that 2 = 1, which is a good sign we were not using infinity in a coherent manner. In recommending how to use the concept of infinity coherently, Bertrand Russell said pejoratively:

The whole difficulty of the subject lies in the necessity of thinking in an unfamiliar way, and in realising that many properties which we have thought inherent in number are in fact peculiar to finite numbers. If this is remembered, the positive theory of infinity...will not be found so difficult as it is to those who cling obstinately to the prejudices instilled by the arithmetic which is learnt in childhood. (Salmon 1970, 58)

That positive theory of infinity that Russell is talking about is set theory, and the new arithmetic is the result of Cantor’s generalizing the notions of order and of size of sets into the infinite, that is, to the infinite ordinals and infinite cardinals. These numbers are also called transfinite ordinals and transfinite cardinals. The following sections will briefly explore set theory and the role of infinity within mathematics. The main idea, though, is that the basic theories of mathematical physics are properly expressed using the differential calculus with real-number variables, and these concepts are well-defined in terms of set theory which, in turn, requires using actual infinities or transfinite infinities of various kinds.

a. Infinite Sums

In the 17th century, when Newton and Leibniz invented calculus, they wondered what the value is of this infinite sum:

1/1 + 1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 + ....

They believed the sum is 2. Knowing about the dangers of talking about infinity, most later mathematicians hoped to find a technique to avoid using the phrase “infinite sum.” Cauchy and Weierstrass eventually provided this technique two centuries later. They removed any mention of “infinite sum” by using the formal idea of a limit. Informally, the Cauchy-Weierstrass idea is that instead of overtly saying the infinite sum s1 + s2 + s3 + … is some number S, as Newton and Leibniz were saying, one should say that the sequence converges to S just in case the numerical difference between any pair of terms within the sequence is as small as one desires, provided the two terms are sufficiently far out in the sequence. More formally it is expressed this way: The series s1 + s2 + s3 + … converges to S if, and only if, for every positive number ε there exists a number δ such that |sn+h +  sn| < ε for all integers n > δ and all integers h > 0. In this way, reference to an actual infinity has been eliminated.

This epsilon-delta technique of talking about limits was due to Cauchy in 1821 and Weierstrass in the period from 1850 to 1871. The two drawbacks to this technique are that (1) it is unintuitive and more complicated than Newton and Leibniz’s intuitive approach that did mention infinite sums, and (2) it is not needed because infinite sums were eventually legitimized by being given a set-theoretic foundation.

b. Infinitesimals and Hyperreals

There has been considerable controversy throughout history about how to understand infinitesimal objects and infinitesimal changes in the properties of objects. Intuitively an infinitesimal object is as small as you please but not quite nothing. Infinitesimal objects and infinitesimal methods were first used by Archimedes in ancient Greece, but he did not mention them in any publication intended for the public because he did not consider his use of them to be rigorous. Infinitesimals became better known when Leibniz used them in his differential and integral calculus. The differential calculus can be considered to be a technique for treating continuous motion as being composed of an infinite number of infinitesimal steps. The calculus’ use of infinitesimals led to the so-called “golden age of nothing” in which infinitesimals were used freely in mathematics and science. During this period, Leibniz, Euler, and the Bernoullis applied the concept. Euler applied it cavalierly (although his intuition was so good that he rarely if ever made mistakes), but Leibniz and the Bernoullis were concerned with the general question of when we could, and when we could not, consider an infinitesimal to be zero. They were aware of apparent problems with these practices in large part because they had been exposed by Berkeley.

In 1734, George Berkeley attacked the concept of infinitesimal as ill-defined and incoherent because there were no definite rules for when the infinitesimal should be and shouldn’t be considered to be zero. Berkeley, like Leibniz, was thinking of infinitesimals as objects with a constant value--as genuinely infinitesimally small magnitudes--whereas Newton thought of them as variables that could arbitrarily approach zero. Either way, there were coherence problems. The scientists and results-oriented mathematicians of the golden age of nothing had no good answer to the coherence problem. As standards of rigorous reasoning increased over the centuries, mathematicians became more worried about infinitesimals. They were delighted when Cauchy in 1821 and Weierstrass in the period from 1850 to 1875 developed a way to use calculus without infinitesimals, and at this time any appeal to infinitesimals was considered illegitimate, and mathematicians soon stopped using infinitesimals.

Here is how Cauchy and Weierstrass eliminated infinitesimals with their concept of limit. Suppose we have a function f,  and we are interested in the Cartesian graph of the curve y = f(x) at some point a along the x axis. What is the rate of change of  f at a? This is the slope of the tangent line at a, and it is called the derivative f' at a. This derivative was defined by Leibniz to be


where h is an infinitesimal. Because of suspicions about infinitesimals, Cauchy and Weierstrass suggested replacing Leibniz’s definition of the derivative with


That is,  f'(a) is the limit, as x approaches a, of the above ratio. The limit idea was rigorously defined using Cauchy’s well known epsilon and delta method. Soon after the Cauchy-Weierstrass’ definition of derivative was formulated, mathematicians stopped using infinitesimals.

The scientists did not follow the lead of the mathematicians. Despite the lack of a coherent theory of infinitesimals, scientists continued to reason with infinitesimals because infinitesimal methods were so much more intuitively appealing than the mathematicians’ epsilon-delta methods. Although students in calculus classes in the early 21st century are still taught the unintuitive epsilon-delta methods, Abraham Robinson (Robinson 1966) created a rigorous alternative to standard Weierstrassian analysis by using the methods of model theory to define infinitesimals.

Here is Robinson’s idea. Think of the rational numbers in their natural order as being gappy with real numbers filling the gaps between them. Then think of the real numbers as being gappy with hyperreals filling the gaps between them. There is a cloud or region of hyperreals surrounding each real number (that is, surrounding each real number described nonstandardly). To develop these ideas more rigorously, Robinson used this simple definition of an infinitesimal:

h is infinitesimal if and only if 0 < |h| < 1/n, for every positive integer n.

|h| is the absolute value of h.

Robinson did not actually define an infinitesimal as a number on the real line. The infinitesimals were defined on a new number line, the hyperreal line, that contains within it the structure of the standard real numbers from classical analysis. In this sense the hyperreal line is the extension of the reals to the hyperreals. The development of analysis via infinitesimals creates a nonstandard analysis with a hyperreal line and a set of hyperreal numbers that include real numbers. In this nonstandard analysis, 78+2h is a hyperreal that is infinitesimally close to the real number 78. Sums and products of infinitesimals are infinitesimal.

Because of the rigor of the extension, all the arguments for and against Cantor’s infinities apply equally to the infinitesimals. Sentences about the standardly-described reals are true if and only if they are true in this extension to the hyperreals. Nonstandard analysis allows proofs of all the classical theorems of standard analysis, but it very often provides shorter, more direct, and more elegant proofs than those that were originally proved by using standard analysis with epsilons and deltas. Objections by practicing mathematicians to infinitesimals subsided after this was appreciated. With a good definition of “infinitesimal” they could then use it to explain related concepts such as in the sentence, “That curve approaches infinitesimally close to that line.” See (Wolf 2005, chapter 7) for more about infinitesimals and hyperreals.

c. Mathematical Existence

Mathematics is apparently about mathematical objects, so it is apparently about infinitely large objects, infinitely small objects, and infinitely many objects. Mathematicians who are doing mathematics and are not being careful about ontology too easily remark that there are infinite dimensional spaces, the continuum, continuous functions, an infinity of functions, and this or that infinite structure. Do these infinities really exist? The philosophical literature is filled with arguments pro and con and with fine points about senses of existence.

When axiomatizing geometry, Euclid said that between any two points one could choose to construct a line. Opposed to Euclid’s constructivist stance, many modern axiomatizers take a realist philosophical stance by declaring simply that there exists a line between any two points, so the line pre-exists any construction process. In mathematics, the constructivist will recognize the existence of a mathematical object only if there is at present an algorithm (that is, a step by step “mechanical” procedure operating on symbols that is finitely describable, that requires no ingenuity and that uses only finitely many steps) for constructing or finding such an object. Assertions require proofs. The constructivist believes that to justifiably assert the negation of a sentence S is to prove that the assumption of S leads to a contradiction. So, legitimate mathematical objects must be shown to be constructible in principle by some mental activity and cannot be assumed to pre-exist any such construction process nor to exist simply because their non-existence would be contradictory. A constructivist, unlike a realist, is a kind of conceptualist, one who believes that an unknowable mathematical object is impossible. Most constructivists complain that, although potential infinites can be constructed, actual infinities cannot be.

There are many different schools of constructivism. The first systematic one, and perhaps the most well known version and most radical version, is due to L.E.J. Brouwer. He is not a finitist,  but his intuitionist school demands that all legitimate mathematics be constructible from a basis of mental processes he called “intuitions.” These intuitions might be more accurately called “clear mental procedures.” If there were no minds capable of having these intuitions, then there would be no mathematical objects just as there would be no songs without ideas in the minds of composers. Numbers are human creations. The number pi is intuitionistically legitimate because we have an algorithm for computing all its decimal digits, but the following number g is not legitimate: The following number g is illegitimate. It is the number whose nth digit is either 0 or 1, and it is 1 if and only if there are n consecutive 7s in the decimal expansion of pi. No person yet knows how to construct the decimal digits of g. Brouwer argued that the actually infinite set of natural numbers cannot be constructed (using intuitions) and so does not exist. The best we can do is to have a rule for adding more members to a set. So, his concept of an acceptable infinity is closer to that of potential infinity than actual infinity. Hermann Weyl emphasizes the merely potential character of these infinities:

Brouwer made it clear, as I think beyond any doubt, that there is no evidence supporting the belief in the existential character of the totality of all natural numbers…. The sequence of numbers which grows beyond any stage already reached by passing to the next number, is a manifold of possibilities open towards infinity; it remains forever in the status of creation, but is not a closed realm of things existing in themselves. (Weyl is quoted in (Kleene 1967, p. 195))

It is not legitimate for platonic realists, said Brouwer, to bring all the sets into existence at once by declaring they are whatever objects satisfy all the axioms of set theory. Brouwer believed realists accept too many sets because they are too willing to accept sets merely by playing coherently with the finite symbols for them when sets instead should be tied to our experience. For Brouwer this experience is our experience of time. He believed we should arrive at our concept of the infinite by noticing that our experience of a duration can be divided into parts and then these parts can be further divided, and so. This infinity is a potential infinity, not an actual infinity. For the intuitionist, there is no determinate, mind-independent mathematical reality which provides the facts to make mathematical sentences true or false. This metaphysical position is reflected in the principles of logic that are acceptable to an intuitionist. For the intuitionist, the sentence “For all x, x has property F” is true only if we have already proved constructively that each x has property F. And it is false only if we have proved that some x does not have property F. Otherwise, it is neither true nor false. The intuitionist does not accept the principle of excluded middle: For any sentence S, either S or the negation of S. Outraged by this intuitionist position, David Hilbert famously responded by saying, “To take the law of the excluded middle away from the mathematician would be like denying the astronomer the telescope or the boxer the use of his fists.” (quoted from Kleene 1967, p. 197) For a presentation of intuitionism with philosophical emphasis, see (Posy 2005) and (Dummett 1977).

Finitists, even those who are not constructivists, also argue that the actually infinite set of natural numbers does not exist. They say there is a finite rule for generating each numeral from the previous one, but the rule does not produce an actual infinity of either numerals or numbers. The ultrafinitist considers the classical finitist to be too liberal because finite numbers such as 2100 and 21000 can never be accessed by a human mind in a reasonable amount of time. Only the numerals or symbols for those numbers can be coherently manipulated. One challenge to ultrafinitists is that they should explain where the cutoff point is between numbers that can be accessed and numbers that cannot be. Ultrafinitsts have risen to this challenge. The mathematician Harvey Friedman says:

I raised just this objection [about a cutoff] with the (extreme) ultrafinitist Yessenin-Volpin during a lecture of his. He asked me to be more specific. I then proceeded to start with 21 and asked him whether this is “real” or something to that effect. He virtually immediately said yes. Then I asked about 22, and he again said yes, but with a perceptible delay. Then 23, and yes, but with more delay. This continued for a couple of more times, till it was obvious how he was handling this objection. Sure, he was prepared to always answer yes, but he was going to take 2100 times as long to answer yes to 2100 than he would to answering 21. There is no way that I could get very far with this. (Elwes 2010, 317)

This battle among competing philosophies of mathematics will not be explored in depth in this article, but this section will offer a few more points about mathematical existence.

Hilbert argued that, “If the arbitrarily given axioms do not contradict one another, then they are true and the things defined by the axioms exist.” But (Chihara 2008, 141) points out that Hilbert seems to be confusing truth with truth in a model. If a set of axioms is consistent, and so is its corresponding axiomatic theory, then the theory defines a class of models, and each axiom is true in any such model, but it does not follow that the axioms are really true. To give a crude, nonmathematical example, consider this set of two axioms {All horses are blue, all cows are green.}. The formal theory using these axioms is consistent and has a model, but it does not follow that either axiom is really true.

Quine objected to Hilbert's criterion for existence as being too liberal. Quine’s argument for infinity in mathematics begins by noting that our fundamental scientific theories are our best tools for helping us understand reality and doing ontology. Mathematical theories which imply the existence of some actually infinite sets are indispensable to all these scientific theories, and their referring to these infinities cannot be paraphrased away. All this success is a good reason to believe in some actual infinite sets and to say the sentences of both the mathematical theories and the scientific theories are true or approximately true since their success would otherwise be a miracle. But, he continues, of course it is no miracle. See (Quine 1960 chapter 7).

Quine believed that infinite sets exist only if they are indispensable in successful applications of mathematics to science; but he believed science so far needs only the first three alephs: ℵ0 for the integers, ℵ1 for the set of point places in space, and ℵ2 for the number of possible lines in space (including lines that are not continuous). The rest of Cantor’s heaven of transfinite numbers is unreal, Quine said, and the mathematics of the extra transfinite numbers is merely “recreational mathematics.” But Quine showed intellectual flexibility by saying that if he were to be convinced more transfinite sets were needed in science, then he’d change his mind about which alephs are real. To briefly summarize Quine’s position, his indispensability argument treats mathematical entities on a par with all other theoretical entities in science and says mathematical statements can be (approximately) true. Quine points out that reference to mathematical entities is vital to science, and there is no way of separating out the evidence for the mathematics from the evidence for the science. This famous indispensability argument has been attacked in many ways. Critics charge, “Quite aside from the intrinsic logical defects of set theory as a deductive theory, this is disturbing because sets are so very different from physical objects as ordinarily conceived, and because the axioms of set theory are so very far removed from any kind of empirical support or empirical testability…. Not even set theory itself can tell us how the existence of a set (e.g. a power set) is empirically manifested.” (Mundy 1990, pp. 289-90). See (Parsons 1980) for more details about Quine’s and other philosophers’ arguments about existence of mathematical objects.

d. Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory

Cantor initially thought of a set as being a collection of objects that can be counted, but this notion eventually gave way to a set being a collection that has a clear membership condition. Over several decades, Cantor’s naive set theory evolved into ZF, Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory, and ZF was accepted by most mid-20th century mathematicians as the correct tool to use for deciding which mathematical objects exist. The acceptance was based on three reasons. (1) ZF is precise and rigorous. (2) ZF is useful for defining or representing other mathematical concepts and methods. Mathematics can be modeled in set theory; it can be given a basis in set theory. (3) No inconsistency has been uncovered despite heavy usage.

Notice that one of the three reasons is not that set theory provides a foundation to mathematics in the sense of justifying the doing of mathematics or in the sense of showing its sentences are certain or necessary. Instead, set theory provides a basis for theories only in the sense that it helps to organize them, to reveal their interrelationships, and to provide a means to precisely define their concepts. The first program for providing this basis began in the late 19th century. Peano had given an axiomatization of the natural numbers. It can be expressed in set theory using standard devices for treating natural numbers and relations and functions and so forth as being sets. (For example, zero is the empty set, and a relation is a set of ordered pairs.) Then came the arithmetization of analysis which involved using set theory to construct from the natural numbers all the negative numbers and the fractions and real numbers and complex numbers. Along with this, the principles of these numbers became sentences of set theory. In this way, the assumptions used in informal reasoning in arithmetic are explicitly stated in the formalism, and proofs in informal arithmetic can be rewritten as formal proofs so that no creativity is required for checking the correctness of the proofs. Once a mathematical theory is given a set theoretic basis in this manner, it follows that if we have any philosophical concerns about the higher level mathematical theory, those concerns will also be concerns about the lower level set theory in the basis.

In addition to Dedekind’s definition, there are other acceptable definitions of "infinite set" and "finite set" using set theory. One popular one is to define a finite set as a set onto which a one-to-one function maps the set of all natural numbers that are less than some natural number n. That finite set contains n elements. An infinite set is then defined as one that is not finite. Dedekind, himself, used another definition; he defined an infinite set as one that is not finite, but defined a finite set as any set in which there exists no one-to-one mapping of the set into a proper subset of itself. The philosopher C. S. Peirce suggested essentially the same approach as Dedekind at approximately the same time, but he received little notice from the professional community. For more discussion of the details, see (Wilder 1965, p. 66f, and Suppes 1960, p. 99n).

Set theory implies quite a bit about infinity. First, infinity in ZF has some very unsurprising features. If a set A is infinite and is the same size as set B, then B also is infinite. If A is infinite and is a subset of B, then B also is infinite. Using the axiom of choice, it follows that a set is infinite just in case for every natural number n, there is some subset whose size is n.

ZF’s axiom of infinity declares that there is at least one infinite set, a so-called inductive set containing zero and the successor of each of its members (such as {0, 1, 2, 3, …}). The power set axiom (which says every set has a power set, namely a set of all its subsets) then generates many more infinite sets of larger cardinality, a surprising result that Cantor first discovered in 1874.

In ZF, there is no set with maximum cardinality, nor a set of all sets, nor an infinitely descending sequence of sets x0, x1, x2, ... in which x1 is in x0, and x2 is in x1, and so forth. There is however, an infinitely ascending sequence of sets x0, x1, x2, ... in which x0 is in x1, and x1 is in x2, and so forth. In ZF, a set exists if it is implied by the axioms; there is no requirement that there be some property P such that the set is the extension of P. That is, there is no requirement that the set be defined as {x| P(x)} for some property P. One especially important feature of ZF is that for any condition or property, there is only one set of objects having that property, but it cannot be assumed that for any property, there is a set of all those objects that have that property. For example, it cannot be assumed that, for the property of being a set, there is a set of all objects having that property.

In ZF, all sets are pure. A set is pure if it is empty or its members are sets, and its members' members are sets, and so forth. In informal set theory, a set can contain cows and electrons and other non-sets.

In the early years of set theory, the terms "set" and "class" and “collection” were used interchangeably, but in von Neumann–Bernays–Gödel set theory (NBG or VBG) a set is defined to be a class that is an element of some other class. NBG is designed to have proper classes, classes that are not sets, even though they can have members which are sets. The intuitive idea is that a proper class is a collection that is too big to be a set. There can be a proper class of all sets, but neither a set of all sets nor a class of all classes. A nice feature of NBG is that a sentence in the language of ZFC is provable in NBG only if it is provable in ZFC.

Are philosophers justified in saying there is more to know about sets than is contained within ZF set theory? If V is the collection or class of all sets, do mathematicians have any access to V independently of the axioms? This is an open question that arose concerning the axiom of choice and the continuum hypothesis.

e. The Axiom of Choice and the Continuum Hypothesis

Consider whether to believe in the axiom of choice. The axiom of choice is the assertion that, given any collection of non-empty and non-overlapping sets, there exists a ‘choice set’ which is composed of one element chosen from each set in the collection. However, the axiom does not say how to do the choosing. For some sets there might not be a precise rule of choice. If the collection is infinite and its sets are not well-ordered in any way that has been specified, then there is in general no way to define the choice set. The axiom is implicitly used throughout the field of mathematics, and several important theorems cannot be proved without it. Mathematical Platonists tend to like the axiom, but those who want explicit definitions or constructions for sets do not like it. Nor do others who note that mathematics’ most unintuitive theorem, the Banach-Tarski Theorem, requires the axiom of choice. The dispute can get quite intense with advocates of the axiom of choice saying that their opponents are throwing out invaluable mathematics, while these opponents consider themselves to be removing tainted mathematics. See (Wagon 1985) for more on the Banach-Tarski Theorem; see (Wolf 2005, pp. 226-8) for more discussion of which theorems require the axiom.

A set is always smaller than its power set. How much bigger is the power set? Cantor’s controversial continuum hypothesis says that the cardinality of the power set of ℵ0 is ℵ1, the next larger cardinal number, and not some higher cardinal. The generalized continuum hypothesis is more general; it says that, given an infinite set of any cardinality, the cardinality of its power set is the next larger cardinal and not some even higher cardinal. Cantor believed the continuum hypothesis is true, but he was frustrated that he could not prove it. The philosophical issue is whether we should alter the axioms to enable the hypotheses to be proved.

If ZF is formalized as a first-order theory of deductive logic, then both Cantor’s generalized continuum hypothesis and the axiom of choice are consistent with the other principles of set theory but cannot be proved or disproved from them, assuming that ZF is not inconsistent. In this sense, both the continuum hypothesis and the axiom of choice are independent of ZF. Gödel in 1940 and Cohen in 1964 contributed to the proof of this independence result.

So, how do we decide whether to believe the axiom of choice and continuum hypothesis, and how do we decide whether to add them to the principles of ZF or any other set theory? Most mathematicians do believe the axiom of choice is true, but there is more uncertainty about the continuum hypothesis. The independence does not rule out our someday finding a convincing argument that the hypothesis is true or a convincing argument that it is false, but the argument will need more premises than just the principles of ZF. At this point the philosophers of mathematics divide into two camps. The realists, who think there is a unique universe of sets to be discovered, believe that if ZF does not fix the truth values of the continuum hypothesis and the axiom of choice, then this is a defect within ZF and we need to explore our intuitions about infinity in order to uncover a missing axiom or two for ZF that will settle the truth values. These persons prefer to think that there is a single system of mathematics to which set theory is providing a foundation, but they would prefer not simply to add the continuum hypothesis itself as an axiom because the hope is to make the axioms "readily believable," yet it is not clear enough that the axiom itself is readily believable. The second camp of philosophers of mathematics disagree and say the concept of infinite set is so vague that we simply do not have any intuitions that will or should settle the truth values. According to this second camp, there are set theories with and without axioms that fix the truth values of the axiom of choice and the continuum hypothesis, and set theory should no more be a unique theory of sets than Euclidean geometry should be the unique theory of geometry.

Believing that ZFC’s infinities are merely the above-surface part of the great iceberg of infinite sets, many set theorists are actively exploring new axioms that imply the existence of sets that could not be proved to exist within ZFC. So far there is no agreement among researchers about the acceptability of any of the new axioms. See (Wolf 2005, pp. 226-8) and (Rucker 1982) pp. 252-3 for more discussion of the search for these new axioms.

6. Infinity in Deductive Logic

The infinite appears in many interesting ways in formal deductive logic, and this section presents an introduction to a few of those ways. Among all the various kinds of formal deductive logics, first-order logic (the usual predicate logic) stands out as especially important, in part because of the accuracy and detail with which it can mirror mathematical deductions. First-order logic also stands out because it is the strongest logic that has a proof for every one of its logically true sentences, and that is compact in the sense that if an infinite set of its sentences is inconsistent, then so is some finite subset.

But just what is first-order logic? To answer this and other questions, it is helpful to introduce some technical terminology. Here is a chart of what is ahead:

First-order language First-order theory First-order formal system First-order logic
Definition Formal language with quantifiers over objects but not over sets of objects. A set of sentences expressed in a first-order language. First-order theory plus its method for building proofs. First-order language with its method for building proofs.

A first-order theory is a set of sentences expressed in a first-order language (which will be defined below). A first-order formal system is a first-order theory plus its deductive structure (method of building proofs). The term “first-order logic” is ambiguous. It can mean a first-order language with its deductive structure, or it can mean simply the academic subject or discipline that studies first-order languages and theories.

Classical first-order logic is distinguished by its satisfying certain classically-accepted assumptions: that it has only two truth values; in an interpretation or valuation [note: the terminology is not standardized] , every sentence gets exactly one of the two truth values; no well-formed formula (wff) can contain an infinite number of symbols; a valid deduction cannot be made from true sentences to a false one; deductions cannot be infinitely long; the domain of an interpretation cannot be empty but can have any infinite cardinality; an individual constant (name) must name something in the domain; and so forth.

A formal language specifies the language’s vocabulary symbols and its syntax, primarily what counts as being a term or name and what are its well-formed formulas (wffs). A first-order language is a formal language whose symbols are the quantifiers (∃), connectives (↔), constants (a), variables (x), predicates or relations (R), and perhaps functions (f) and equality (=). It has a denumerable list of variables. (A set is denumerable or countably infinite if it has size ℵ0.) A first-order language has a countably finite or countably infinite number of predicate symbols and function symbols, but not a zero number of both. First-order languages differ from each other only in their predicate symbols or function symbols or constants symbols or in having or not having the equality symbol. See (Wolf 2005, p. 23) for more details. Every wff in a first-order language must contain only finitely many symbols. There are denumerably many terms, formulas, and sentences. Because there are uncountably many real numbers, a theory of real numbers in a first-order language does not have enough names for all the real numbers.

To carry out proofs or deductions in a first-order language, the language needs to be given a deductive structure. There are several different ways to do this (via axioms, natural deduction, sequent calculus), but the ways all are independent of which first-order language is being used, and they all require specifying rules such as modus ponens for how to deduce wffs from finitely many previous wffs in the deduction.

To give some semantics or meaning to its symbols, the first-order language needs a definition of valuation and of truth in a valuation and of validity of an argument. In a propositional logic, the valuation assigns to each sentence letter a single truth value; in predicate logic each term is given a denotation, and each predicate is given a set of objects in the domain that satisfy the predicate. The valuation rules then determine the truth values of all the wffs. The valuation’s domain is a set containing all the objects that the terms might denote and that the variables range over. The domain may be of any finite or transfinite size, but the variables can range only over objects in this domain, not over sets of those objects.

Because a first-order language cannot successfully express sentences that generalize over sets (or properties or classes or relations) of the objects in the domain, it cannot, for example, adequately express Leibniz’s Law that, “If objects a and b are identical, then they have the same properties.” A second-order language can do this. A language is second-order if in addition to quantifiers on variables that range over objects in the domain it also has quantifiers (such as œthe universal quantifier ∀P) on a second kind of variable P that ranges over properties (or classes or relations) of these objects. Here is one way to express Leibniz’s Law in second-order logic:

(a = b) --> ∀P(Pa ↔ Pb)

P is called a predicate variable or property variable. Every valid deduction in first-order logic is also valid in second-order logic. A language is third-order if it has quantifiers on variables that range over properties of properties of objects (or over sets of sets of objects), and so forth. A language is called higher-order if it is at least second-order.

The definition of first-order theory given earlier in this section was that it is any set of wffs in a first-order language. A more ordinary definition adds that it is closed under deduction. This additional requirement implies that every deductive consequence of some sentences of the theory also is in the theory. Since the consequences are countably infinite, all ordinary first-order theories are countably infinite.

If the language isn’t explicitly mentioned for a first-order theory, then it is generally assumed that the language is the smallest first-order language that contains all the sentences of the theory. Valuations of the language in which all the sentences of the theory are true are said to be models of the theory.

If the theory is axiomatized, then in addition to the logical axioms there are proper axioms (also called non-logical axioms); these axioms are specific to the theory (and so usually do not hold in other first-order theories). For example, Peano’s axioms when expressed in a first-order language are proper axioms for the formal theory of arithmetic, but they aren't logical axioms or logical truths. See (Wolf, 2005, pp. 32-3) for specific proper axioms of Peano Arithmetic and for proofs of some of its important theorems.

Besides the above problem about Leibniz’s Law, there is a related problem about infinity that occurs when Peano Arithmetic is expressed as a first-order theory. Gödel’s First Incompleteness Theorem proves that there are some bizarre truths which are independent of first-order Peano Arithmetic (PA), and so cannot be deduced within PA. None of these truths so far are known to lie in mainstream mathematics. But they might. And there is another reason to worry about the limitations of PA. Because the set of sentences of PA is only countable, whereas there are uncountably many sets of numbers in informal arithmetic, it might be that PA is inadequate for expressing and proving some important theorems about sets of numbers. See (Wolf 2005, pp. 33-4, 225).

It seems that all the important theorems of arithmetic and the rest of mathematics can be expressed and proved in another first-order theory, Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with the axiom of choice (ZFC). Unlike first-order Peano Arithmetic, ZFC needs only a very simple first-order language that surprisingly has no undefined predicate symbol, equality symbol, relation symbol, or function symbol, other than a single two-place binary relation symbol intended to represent set membership. The domain is intended to be composed only of sets but since mathematical objects can be defined to be sets, the domain contains these mathematical objects.

a. Finite and Infinite Axiomatizability

In the process of axiomatizing a theory, any sentence of the theory can be called an axiom. When axiomatizing a theory, there is no problem with having an infinite number of axioms so long as the set of axioms is decidable, that is, so long as there is a finitely long computation or mechanical procedure for deciding, for any sentence, whether it is an axiom.

Logicians are curious as to which formal theories can be finitely axiomatized in a given formal system and which can only be infinitely axiomatized. Group theory is finitely axiomatizable in classical first-order logic, but Peano Arithmetic and ZFC are not. Peano Arithmetic is not finitely axiomatizable because it requires an axiom scheme for induction. An axiom scheme is a countably infinite number of axioms of similar form, and an axiom scheme for induction would be an infinite number of axioms of the form (expressed here informally): “If property P of natural numbers holds for zero, and also holds for n+1 whenever it holds for natural number n, then P holds for all natural numbers.” There needs to be a separate axiom for every property P, but there is a countably infinite number of these properties expressible in a first-order language of elementary arithmetic.

Assuming ZF is consistent, ZFC is not finitely axiomatizable in first-order logic, as Richard Montague discovered. Nevertheless ZFC is a subset of von Neumann–Bernays–Gödel (NBG) set theory, and the latter is finitely axiomatizable, as Paul Bernays discovered. The first-order theory of Euclidean geometry is not finitely axiomatizable, and the second-order logic used in (Field 1980) to reconstruct mathematical physics without quantifying over numbers also is not finitely axiomatizable. See (Mendelson 1997) for more discussion of finite axiomatizability.

b. Infinitely Long Formulas

An infinitary logic is a logic that makes one of classical logic’s necessarily finite features be infinite. In the languages of classical first-order logic, every formula is required to be only finitely long, but an infinitary logic might relax this. The original, intuitive idea behind requiring finitely long sentences in classical logic was that logic should reflect the finitude of the human mind. But with increasing opposition to psychologism in logic, that is, to making logic somehow dependent on human psychology, researchers began to ignore the finitude restrictions. Löwenheim in about 1915 was perhaps the pioneer here. In 1957, Alfred Tarski and Dana Scott explored permitting the operations of conjunction and disjunction to link infinitely many formulas into an infinitely long formula. Tarski also suggested allowing formulas to have a sequence of quantifiers of any transfinite length. William Hanf proved in 1964 that, unlike classical logics, these infinitary logics fail to be compact. See (Barwise 1975) for more discussion of these developments.

c. Infinitely Long Proofs

Classical formal logic requires proofs to contain a finite number of steps. In the mid-20th century with the disappearance of psychologism in logic, researchers began to investigate logics with infinitely long proofs as an aid to simplifying consistency proofs. See (Barwise 1975).

d. Infinitely Many Truth Values

One reason for permitting an infinite number of truth values is to represent the idea that truth is a matter of degree. The intuitive idea is that, say, depending on the temperature, the truth of “This cup of coffee is warm” might be definitely true, less true, even less true, and so forth

One of the simplest infinite-valued semantics uses a continuum of truth values. Its valuations assign to each basic sentence (a formal sentence that contains no connectives or quantifiers) a truth value that is a specific number in the closed interval of real numbers from 0 to 1. The truth value of the vague sentence “This water is warm” is understood to be definitely true if it has the truth value 1 and definitely false if it has the truth value 0. To sentences having main connectives, the valuation assigns to the negation ~P of any sentence P the truth value of one minus the truth value assigned to P. It assigns to the conjunction P & Q the minimum of the truth values of P and of Q. It assigns to the disjunction P v Q the maximum of the truth values of P and of Q, and so forth.

One advantage to using an infinite-valued semantics is that by permitting modus ponens to produce a conclusion that is slightly less true than either premise, we can create a solution to the paradox of the heap, the sorites paradox. One disadvantage is that there is no well-motivated choice for the specific real number that is the truth value of a vague statement. What is the truth value appropriate to “This water is warm” when the temperature is 100 degrees Fahrenheit and you are interested in cooking pasta in it? Is the truth value 0.635? This latter problem of assigning truth values to specific sentences without being arbitrary has led to the development of fuzzy logics in place of the simpler infinite-valued semantics we have been considering. Lofti Zadeh suggested that instead of vague sentences having any of a continuum of precise truth values we should make the continuum of truth values themselves imprecise. His suggestion was to assign a sentence a truth value that is a fuzzy set of numerical values, a set for which membership is a matter of degree. For more details, see (Nolt 1997, pp. 420-7).

e. Infinite Models

A countable language is a language with countably many symbols. The Löwenhim Skolem Theorem says:

If a first-order theory in a countable language has an infinite model, then it has a countably infinite model.

This is a surprising result about infinity. Would you want your theory of real numbers to have a countable model? Strictly speaking it is a puzzle and not a paradox because the property of being countably infinite is a property it has when viewed from outside the object language not within it. The theorem does not imply first-order theories of real numbers must have no more real numbers than there are natural numbers.

The Löwenhim-Skolem Theorem can be extended to say that if a theory in a countable language has a model of some infinite size, then it also has models of any infinite size. This is a limitation on first-order theories; they do not permit having a categorical theory of an infinite structure.  A formal theory is said to be categorical if any two models satisfying the theory are isomorphic. The two models are isomorphic if they have the same structure; and they can’t be isomorphic if they have different sizes. So, if you create a first-order theory intended to describe a single infinite structure of a certain size, the theory will end up having, for any infinite size, a model of that size. This frustrates the hopes of anyone who would like to have a first-order theory of arithmetic that has models only of size ℵ0, and to have a first-order theory of real numbers that has models only of size 20.  See (Enderton 1972, pp. 142-3) for more discussion of this limitation.

Because of this limitation, many logicians have turned to second-order logics. There are second-order categorical theories for the natural numbers and for the real numbers. Unfortunately, there is no sound and complete deductive structure for any second-order logic having a decidable set of axioms; this is a major negative feature of second-order logics.

To illustrate one more surprise regarding infinity in formal logic, notice that the quantifiers are defined in terms of their domain, the domain of discourse. In a first-order set theory, the expression ∃xPx says there exists some set x in the infinite domain of all the sets such that x has property P. Unfortunately, in ZF there is no set of all sets to serve as this domain. So, it is oddly unclear what the expression ∃xPx means when we intend to use it to speak about sets.

f. Infinity and Truth

According to Alfred Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem, in an arbitrary first-order language a global truth predicate is not definable. A global truth predicate is a predicate which is satisfied by all and only the names (via, say, Gödel numbering) of all the true sentences of the formal language. According to Tarski, since no single language has a global truth predicate, the best approach to expressing truth formally within the language is to expand the  language into an infinite hierarchy of languages, with each higher language (the metalanguage) containing a truth predicate that can apply to all and only the true sentences of languages lower in the hierarchy. This process is iterated into the transfinite to obtain Tarski's hierarchy of metalanguages. Some philosophers have suggested that this infinite hierarchy is implicit within natural languages such as English, but other philosophers, including Tarski himself, believe an informal language does not contain within it a formal language.

To handle the concept of truth formally, Saul Kripke rejects the infinite hierarchy of metalanguages in favor of an infinite hierarchy of interpretations (that is, valuations) of a single language, such as a first-order predicate calculus, with enough apparatus to discuss its own syntax. The language’s intended truth predicate T is the only basic (atomic) predicate that is ever partially-interpreted at any stage of the hierarchy. At the first step in the hierarchy, all predicates but the single predicate T(x) are interpreted. T(x) is completely uninterpreted at this level. As we go up the hierarchy, the interpretation of the other basic predicates are unchanged, but T is satisfied by the names of sentences that were true at lower levels. For example, at the second level, T is satisfied by the name of the sentence ∀œx(Fx v ~Fx). At each step in the hierarchy, more sentences get truth values, but any sentence that has a truth value at one level has that same truth value at all higher levels. T almost becomes a global truth predicate when the inductive interpretation-building reaches the first so-called fixed point level. At this countably infinite level, although T is a truth predicate for all those sentences having one of the two classical truth values, the predicate is not quite satisfied by the names of every true sentence because it is not satisfied by the names of some of the true sentences containing T. At this fixed point level, the Liar sentence (of the Liar Paradox) is still neither true nor false. For this reason, the Liar sentence is said to fall into a “truth gap” in Kripke’s theory of truth. See (Kripke, 1975).

(Yablo 1993) produced a semantic paradox somewhat like the Liar Paradox. Yablo claimed there is no way to coherently assign a truth value to any of the sentences in the countably infinite sequence of sentences of the form, “None of the subsequent sentences are true.” Ask yourself whether the first sentence in the sequence could be true. Notice that no sentence overtly refers to itself. There is controversy in the literature about whether the paradox actually contains a hidden appeal to self-reference, and there has been some investigation of the parallel paradox in which “true” is replaced by “provable.” See (Beall 2001).

7. Conclusion

There are many aspects of the infinite that this article does not cover. Here are some of them: renormalization in quantum field theory, supertasks and infinity machines, categorematic and syncategorematic uses of the word “infinity,” mereology, ordinal and cardinal arithmetic in ZF, the various non-ZF set theories, non-standard solutions to Zeno's Paradoxes, Cantor's arguments for the Absolute, Kant’s views on the infinite, quantifiers that assert the existence of uncountably many objects, and the detailed arguments for and against constructivism, intuitionism, and finitism. For more discussion of these latter three programs, see (Maddy 1992).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ahmavaara, Y. (1965). “The Structure of Space and the Formalism of Relativistic Quantum Theory,” Journal of Mathematical Physics, 6, 87-93.
    • Uses finite arithmetic in mathematical physics, and argues that this is the correct arithmetic for science.
  • Barrow, John D. (2005). The Infinite Book: A Short Guide to the Boundless, Timeless and Endless. Pantheon Books, New York.
    • An informal and easy-to-understand survey of the infinite in philosophy, theology, science and mathematics. Says which Western philosopher throughout the centuries said what about infinity.
  • Barwise, Jon. (1975) “Infinitary Logics,” in Modern Logic: A Survey, E. Agazzi (ed.), Reidel, Dordrecht, pp. 93-112.
    • An introduction to infinitary logics that emphasizes historical development.
  • Beall, J.C. (2001). “Is Yablo’s Paradox Non-Circular?” Analysis 61, no. 3, pp. 176-87.
    • Discusses the controversy over whether the Yablo Paradox is or isn’t indirectly circular.
  • Cantor, Georg. (1887). "Über die verschiedenen Ansichten in Bezug auf die actualunendlichen Zahlen." Bihang till Kongl. Svenska Vetenskaps-Akademien Handlingar , Bd. 11 (1886-7), article 19. P. A. Norstedt & Sôner: Stockholm.
    • A very early description of set theory and its relationship to old ideas about infinity.
  • Chihara, Charles. (1973). Ontology and the Vicious-Circle Principle. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • Pages 63-65 give Chihara’s reasons for why the Gödel-Cohen independence results are evidence against mathematical Platonism.
  • Chihara, Charles. (2008). “The Existence of Mathematical Objects,” in Proof & Other Dilemmas: Mathematics and Philosophy, Bonnie Gold & Roger A. Simons, eds., The Mathematical Association of America.
    • In chapter 7, Chihara provides a fine survey of the ontological issues in mathematics.
  • Deutsch, David. (2011). The Beginning of Infinity: Explanations that Transform the World. Penguin Books, New York City.
    • Emphasizes the importance of successful explanation in understanding the world, and provides new ideas on the nature and evolution of our knowledge.
  • Descartes, René. (1641). Meditations on First Philosophy.
    • The third meditation says, “But these properties [of God] are so great and excellent, that the more attentively I consider them the less I feel persuaded that the idea I have of them owes its origin to myself alone. And thus it is absolutely necessary to conclude, from all that I have before said, that God exists….”
  • Dummett, Michael. (1977). Elements of Intuitionism. Oxford University Press, Oxford.
    • A philosophically rich presentation of intuitionism in logic and mathematics.
  • Elwes, Richard. (2010). Mathematics 1001: Absolutely Everything That Matters About Mathematics in 1001 Bite-Sized Explanations, Firefly Books, Richmond Hill, Ontario.
    • Contains the quoted debate between Harvey Friedman and a leading ultrafinitist.
  • Enderton, Herbert B. (1972). A Mathematical Introduction to Logic. Academic Press: New York.
    • An introduction to deductive logic that presupposes the mathematical sophistication of an advanced undergraduate mathematics major. The corollary proved on p. 142 says that if a theory in a countable language has a model of some infinite size, then it also has models of any infinite size.
  • Feferman, Anita Burdman, and Solomon. (2004) Alfred Tarski: Life and Logic, Cambridge University Press, New York.
    • A biography of Alfred Tarski, the 20th century Polish and American logician.
  • Field, Hartry. (1980). Science Without Numbers: A Defense of Nominalism. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • Field’s program is to oppose the Quine-Putnam Indispensability argument which apparently implies that mathematical physics requires the existence of mathematical objects such as numbers and sets. Field tries to reformulate scientific theories so, when they are formalized in second-order logic, their quantifiers do not range over abstract mathematical entities. Field’s theory uses quantifiers that range over spacetime points. However, because it uses a second order logic, the theory is also committed to quantifiers that range over sets of spacetime points, and sets are normally considered to be mathematical objects.
  • Gödel, Kurt. (1947/1983). “What is Cantor’s Continuum Problem?” American Mathematical Monthly 54, 515-525. Revised and reprinted in Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings, Paul Benacerraf and Hilary Putnam (eds.), Prentice-Hall, Inc. Englewood Cliffs, 1964.
    • Gödel argues that the failure of ZF to provide a truth value for Cantor’s continuum hypothesis implies a failure of ZF to correctly describe the Platonic world of sets.
  • Greene, Brian. (2004). The Fabric of Reality. Random House, Inc., New York.
    • Promotes the virtues of string theory.
  • Greene, Brian (1999). The Elegant Universe. Vintage Books, New York.
    • The quantum field theory called quantum electrodynamics (QED) is discussed on pp. 121-2.
  • Greene, Brian. (2011). The Hidden Reality: Parallel Universes and the Deep Laws of the Cosmos. Vintage Books, New York.
    • A popular survey of cosmology with an emphasis on string theory.
  • Hawking, Stephen. (2001). The Illustrated A Brief History of Time: Updated and Expanded Edition. Bantam Dell. New York.
    • Chapter 4 of Brief History contains an elementary and non-mathematical introduction to quantum mechanics and Heisenberg’s uncertainty principle.
  • Hilbert, David. (1925). “On the Infinite,” in Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings, Paul Benacerraf and Hilary Putnam (eds.), Prentice-Hall, Inc. Englewood Cliffs, 1964. 134-151.
    • Hilbert promotes what is now called the Hilbert Program for solving the problem of the infinite by requiring a finite basis for all acceptable assertions about the infinite.
  • Kleene, (1967). Mathematical Logic. John Wiley & Sons: New York.
    • An advanced textbook in mathematical logic.
  • Kripke, Saul. (1975). "Outline of a Theory of Truth," Journal of Philosophy 72, pp. 690–716.
    • Describes how to create a truth predicate within a formal language that avoids assigning a truth value to the Liar Sentence.
  • Leibniz, Gottfried. (1702). "Letter to Varignon, with a note on the 'Justification of the Infinitesimal Calculus by that of Ordinary Algebra,'" pp. 542-6. In Leibniz Philosophical Papers and Letters. translated by Leroy E. Loemkr (ed.). D. Reidel Publishing Company, Dordrecht, 1969.
    • Leibniz defends the actual infinite in calculus.
  • Levinas, Emmanuel. (1961). Totalité et Infini. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
    • In Totality and Infinity, the Continental philosopher Levinas describes infinity in terms of the possibilities a person confronts upon encountering other conscious beings.
  • Maddy, Penelope. (1992). Realism in Mathematics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A discussion of the varieties of realism in mathematics and the defenses that have been, and could be, offered for them. The book is an extended argument for realism about mathematical objects. She offers a set theoretic monism in which all physical objects are sets.
  • Maor, E. (1991). To Infinity and Beyond: A Cultural History of the Infinite. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • A survey of many of the issues discussed in this encyclopedia article.
  • Mendelson, Elliolt. (1997). An Introduction to Mathematical Logic, 4th ed. London: Chapman & Hall.
    • Pp. 225–86 discuss NBG set theory.
  • Mill, John Stuart. (1843). A System of Logic: Ratiocinative and Inductive. Reprinted in J. M. Robson, ed., Collected Works, volumes 7 and 8. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1973.
    • Mill argues for empiricism and against accepting the references of theoretical terms in scientific theories if the terms can be justified only by the explanatory success of those theories.
  • Moore, A. W. (2001). The Infinite. Second edition, Routledge, New York.
    • A popular survey of the infinite in metaphysics, mathematics, and science.
  • Mundy, Brent. (1990). “Mathematical Physics and Elementary Logic,” Proceedings of the Biennial Meeting of the Philosophy of Science Association. Vol. 1990, Volume 1. Contributed Papers (1990), pp. 289-301.
    • Discusses the relationships among set theory, logic and physics.
  • Nolt, John. Logics. (1997). Wadsworth Publishing Company, Belmont, California.
    • An undergraduate logic textbook containing in later chapters a brief introduction to non-standard logics such as those with infinite-valued semantics.
  • Norton, John. (2012). "Approximation and Idealization: Why the Difference Matters," Philosophy of Science, 79, pp. 207-232.
    • Recommends being careful about the distinction between approximation and idealization in science.
  • Owen, H. P. (1967). “Infinity in Theology and Metaphysics.” In Paul Edwards (Ed.) The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, volume 4, pp. 190-3.
    • This survey of the topic is still reliable.
  • Parsons, Charles. (1980). “Quine on the Philosophy of Mathematics.” In L. Hahn and P. Schilpp (Eds.) The Philosophy of W. V. Quine, pp. 396-403. La Salle IL: Open Court.
    • Argues against Quine’s position that whether a mathematical entity exists depends on the indispensability of the mathematical term denoting that entity in a true scientific theory.
  • Penrose, Roger. (2005). The Road to Reality: A Complete Guide to the Laws of the Universe. New York: Alfred A. Knopf.
    • A fascinating book about the relationship between mathematics and physics. Many of its chapters assume sophistication in advanced mathematics.
  • Posy, Carl. (2005). “Intuitionism and Philosophy.” In Stewart Shapiro. Ed. (2005). The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • The history of the intuitionism of Brouwer, Heyting and Dummett. Pages 330-1 explain how Brouwer uses choice sequences to develop “even the infinity needed to produce a continuum” non-empirically.
  • Quine, W. V. (1960). Word and Object. Cambridge: MIT Press.
    • Chapter 7 introduces Quine’s viewpoint that set theoretic objects exist because they are needed in the basis of our best scientific theories.
  • Quine, W. V. (1986). The Philosophy of W. V. Quine. Editors: Lewis Edwin Hahn and Paul Arthur Schilpp, Open Court, LaSalle, Illinois.
    • Contains the quotation saying infinite sets exist only insofar as they are needed for scientific theory.
  • Robinson, Abraham. (1966). Non-Standard Analysis. Princeton Univ. Press, Princeton.
    • Robinson’s original theory of the infinitesimal and its use in real analysis to replace the Cauchy-Weierstrass methods that use epsilons and deltas.
  • Rucker, Rudy. (1982). Infinity and the Mind: The Science and Philosophy of the Infinite. Birkhäuser: Boston.
    • A survey of set theory with much speculation about its metaphysical implications.
  • Russell, Bertrand. (1914). Our Knowledge of the External World as a Field for Scientific Method in Philosophy. Open Court Publishing Co.: Chicago.
    • Russell champions the use of contemporary real analysis and physics in resolving Zeno’s paradoxes. Chapter 6 is “The Problem of Infinity Considered Historically,” and that chapter is reproduced in (Salmon, 1970).
  • Salmon, Wesley, ed. (1970). Zeno's Paradoxes. The Bobbs-Merrill Company, Inc., Indianapolis.
    • A collection of the important articles on Zeno's Paradoxes plus a helpful and easy-to-read preface providing an overview of the issues.
  • Smullyan, Raymond. (1967). “Continuum Problem,” in Paul Edwards (ed.), The Encyclopedia of Philosophy, Macmillan Publishing Co. & The Free Press: New York.
    • Discusses the variety of philosophical reactions to the discovery of the independence of the continuum hypotheses from ZF set theory.
  • Suppes, Patrick. (1960). Axiomatic Set Theory. D. Van Nostrand Company, Inc.: Princeton.
    • An undergraduate-level introduction to set theory.
  • Tarski, Alfred. (1924). “Sur les Ensembles Finis,” Fundamenta Mathematicae, Vol. 6, pp. 45-95.
    • Surveys and evaluates alternative definitions of finitude and infinitude proposed by Zermelo, Russell, Sierpinski, Kuratowski, Tarski, and others.
  • Wagon, Stan. (1985). The Banach-Tarski Paradox. Cambridge University Press: Cambridge.
    • The unintuitive Banach-Tarski Theorem says a solid sphere can be decomposed into a finite number of parts and then reassembled into two solid spheres of the same radius as the original sphere. Unfortunately you cannot double your sphere of solid gold this way.
  • Wilder, Raymond L. (1965) Introduction to the Foundations of Mathematics, 2nd ed., John Wiley & Sons, Inc.: New York.
    • An undergraduate-level introduction to the foundation of mathematics.
  • Wolf, Robert S. (2005). A Tour through Mathematical Logic. The Mathematical Association of America: Washington, D.C.
    • Chapters 2 and 6 describe set theory and its historical development. Both the history of the infinitesimal and the development of Robinson’s nonstandard model of analysis are described clearly on pages 280-316.
  • Yablo, Stephen. (1993). “Paradox without Self-Reference.” Analysis 53: 251-52.
    • Yablo presents a Liar-like paradox involving an infinite sequence of sentences that, the author claims, is “not in any way circular,” unlike with the traditional Liar Paradox.


Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.

Differential Ontology

Differential ontology approaches the nature of identity by explicitly formulating a concept of difference as foundational and constitutive, rather than thinking of difference as merely an observable relation between entities, the identities of which are already established or known. Intuitively, we speak of difference in empirical terms, as though it is a contrast between two things; a way in which a thing, A, is not like another thing, B. To speak of difference in this colloquial way, however, requires that A and B each has its own self-contained nature, articulated (or at least articulable) on its own, apart from any other thing. The essentialist tradition, in contrast to the tradition of differential ontology, attempts to locate the identity of any given thing in some essential properties or self-contained identities, and it occupies, in one form or another, nearly all of the history of philosophy. Differential ontology, however, understands the identity of any given thing as constituted on the basis of the ever-changing nexus of relations in which it is found, and thus, identity is a secondary determination, while difference, or the constitutive relations that make up identities, is primary. Therefore, if philosophy wishes to adhere to its traditional, pre-Aristotelian project of arriving at the most basic, fundamental understanding of things, perhaps its target will need to be concepts not rooted in identity, but in difference.

“Differential ontology” is a term that may be applied particularly to the works and ideas of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze. Their successors have extended their work into cinema studies, ethics, theology, technology, politics, the arts, and animal ethics, among others.

This article consists of three main sections. The first explores a brief history of the problem. The historical emergence of the problem in ancient Greek philosophy reveals not only the dangers of a philosophy of difference, but also demonstrates that it is a philosophical problem that is central to the nature of philosophy as such, and is as old as philosophy itself. The second section explores some of the common themes and concerns of differential ontology. The third section discusses differential ontology through the specific lenses of Jacques Derrida and Gilles Deleuze.

Table of Contents

  1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy
    1. Heraclitus
    2. Parmenides
    3. Plato
    4. Aristotle
  2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology
    1. Immanence
    2. Time as Differential
    3. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics
  3. Key Differential Ontologists
    1. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist
    2. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources
    3. Other Sources Cited in this Article

1. The Origins of the Philosophy of Difference in Ancient Greek Philosophy

Although the concept of differential ontology is applied specifically to Derrida and Deleuze, the problem of difference is as old as philosophy itself. Its precursors lie in the philosophies of Heraclitus and Parmenides, it is made explicit in Plato and deliberately shut down in Aristotle, remaining so for some two and a half millennia before being raised again, and turned into an explicit object of thought, by Derrida and Deleuze in the middle of the twentieth century.

a. Heraclitus

From its earliest beginnings, what distinguishes ancient Greek philosophy from a mythologically oriented worldview is philosophy’s attempt to offer a rationally unified picture of the operations of the universe, rather than a cosmos subject to the fleeting and conflicting whims of various deities, differing from humans only in virtue of their power and immortality. The early Milesian philosophers, for instance, had each sought to locate among the various primitive elements a first principle (or archê). Thales had argued that water was the primary principle of all things, while Anaximenes had argued for air. Through various processes and permutations (or in the case of Anaximenes, rarefaction and condensation), this first principle assumes the forms of the various other elements with which we are familiar, and of which the cosmos is comprised. All things come from this primary principle, and eventually, they return to it.

Against such thinkers, Heraclitus of Ephesus (fl. c.500 BCE) argues that fire is the first principle of the cosmos: “The cosmos, the same for all, no god or man made, but it always was, is, and will be, an everlasting fire, being kindled in measures and put out in measures.” (DK22B30) From this passage, we are able to glean a few things. The most obvious divergence is that Heraclitus names fire as the basic element, rather than water, air, or, in the case of Anaximander, the boundless (apeiron). But secondly, unlike the Milesians, Heraclitus does not hold in favor of any would-be origin of the cosmos. The universe always was and always will be this self-manifesting, self-quenching, primordial fire, expressed in nature’s limitless ways. So while fire, for Heraclitus, may be ontologically basic in some sense, it is not temporally basic or primordial: it did not, in the temporal or sequential order of things, come first.

However, like his Milesian predecessors, Heraclitus appears to provide at least a basic account for how fire as first principle transforms: “The turnings of fire: first sea, and of sea, half is earth, half lightning flash.” (DK22B31a) Elsewhere we can see more clearly that fire has ontological priority only in a very limited sense for Heraclitus: “The death of earth is to become water, and the death of water is to become air, and the death of air is to become fire, and reversely.” (DK22B76) Earth becomes water; water becomes air; air becomes fire, and reversely. Combined with the two passages above, we can see that the ontological priority of fire is its transformative power. Fire from the sky consumes water, which later falls from the sky nourishing the earth. Likewise, fire underlies water (which in its greatest accumulations rages and howls as violently as flame itself), out of which comes earth and the meteorological or ethereal activity itself. Thus we can see the greatest point of divergence between Heraclitus and his Milesian forbears: the first principle of Heraclitus is not a substance. Fire, though one of the classical elements, is of its very nature a dynamic element—a vital element that is nothing more than its own transformation. It creates (volcanoes produce land masses; furnaces temper steel; heat cooks our food and keeps us safe from elemental exposure), but it also destroys in countless obvious ways; it hardens and strengthens, just as it weakens and consumes. Fire, then, is not an element in the sense of a thing, but more as a process. In contemporary scientific terms, we would say that it is the result of a chemical reaction, its essence for Heraclitus lies in its obvious dynamism. When we look at things (like tables, trees, homes, people, and so forth), they seem to exemplify a permanence which is saliently missing from our experience of fire.

This brings us to the next point: things, for Heraclitus, only appear to have permanence; or rather, their permanence is a result of the processes that make up the identities of the things in question. Here it is appropriate to cite the famous river example, found in more than one Heraclitean fragment: “You cannot step twice into the same rivers; for fresh waters are flowing in upon you.” (DK22B12) “We step and do not step into the same rivers; we are and are not.” (DK22B49a) These passages highlight the seemingly paradoxical nature of the cosmos. On the one hand, of course there is a meaningful sense in which one may step twice into the same river; one may wade in, wade back out, then walk back in again; this body of water is marked between the same banks, the same land markers, and the same flow of water, and so forth. But therein lies the paradox: the water that one waded into the first time is now completely gone, having been replaced by an entirely new configuration of particles of water. So there is also a meaningful sense in which one cannot step into the same river twice. But it is this particular flowing that makes this river this river, and nothing else. Its identity, therefore (as also my own identity), is an effervescent impermanence, constituted on the basis of the flows that make it up. We peer into nature and see things—rivers, people, animals, and so forth—but these are only temporary constitutions, even deceptions: “Men are deceived in their knowledge of things that are manifest.” (DK22B56) The true nature of nature itself, however, continuously eludes us: “Nature tends to conceal itself.” (DK22B123)

The paradoxical nature of things, (that their identities are constituted on the basis of processes), helps us to make sense of Heraclitus’ proclamation of the unity of opposites, (which both Plato and Aristotle held to be unacceptable). Fire is vital and powerful, raging beneath the appearances of nature like a primordial ontological state of warfare: “War is the father of all and the king of all.” (DK22B53) The very same process-driven nature of things that makes a thing what it is by the same operations tends toward the thing’s undoing as well. As we saw, fire is responsible for the opposite and complementary functions of both creativity and destruction. The nature of things is to tend toward their own undoing and eventual passage into their opposites: “What opposes unites, and the finest attunement stems from things bearing in opposite directions, and all things come about by strife.” (DK22B8).

It is in this sense that all things are, for Heraclitus, one. The creative-destructive operations of nature underlie all of its various expressions, binding the whole of the cosmos together in accordance with a rational principle of organization, recognized only in the universal and timeless truth that everything is constantly subject to the law of flux and impermanence: “It is wise to hearken, not to me, but to the Word [logos—otherwise translatable as reason, argument, rational principle, and so forth], and to confess that all things are one.” (DK22B50). Thus it is that Heraclitus is known as the great thinker of becoming or flux. The being of the cosmos, the most essential fact of its nature, lies in its becoming; its only permanence is its impermanence. For our purposes, we can say that Heraclitus was the first philosopher of difference. Where his predecessors had sought to identify the one primordial, self-identical substance or element, out of which all others had emerged, Heraclitus had attempted to think the world, nothing more than the world, in a permanent state (if this is not too paradoxical) of flux.

b. Parmenides

Parmenides (b. 510 BCE) was likely a young man at the time when Heraclitus was philosophically active. Born in Elea, in Lower Italy, Parmenides’ name is the one most commonly associated with Eleatic monism. While (ironically) there is no one standard interpretation of Eleatic monism, probably the most common understanding of Parmenides is filtered through our familiarity with the paradoxes of his successor, Zeno, who argued, in defense of Parmenides, that what we humans perceive as motion and change are mere illusions.

Against this backdrop, what we know of Parmenides’ views come to us from his didactic poem, titled On Nature, which now exists in only fragmentary form. Here, however, we find Parmenides, almost explicitly objecting to Heraclitus: “It is necessary to say and to think that being is; for it is to be/but it is by no means nothing. These things I bid you ponder./For from this first path of inquiry, I bar you./then yet again from that along which mortals who know nothing/wander two-headed: for haplessness in their/breasts directs wandering understanding. They are borne along/deaf and blind at once, bedazzled, undiscriminating hordes,/who have supposed that being and not-being are the same/and not the same; but the path of all is back-turning.” (DK28B6) There are a couple of important things to note here. First, the mention of those who suppose that being and not-being are the same and not the same hearkens almost explicitly to Heraclitus’ notion of the unity of opposites. Secondly, Parmenides declares this to be the opinion of the undiscriminating hordes, the masses of non-philosophically-minded mortals.

Therefore, Heraclitus, on Parmenides’ view, does not provide a philosophical account of being; rather, he simply coats in philosophical language the everyday experience of the mob. Against Heraclitus’ critical diagnosis that humans (deceptively) see only permanent things, Parmenides claims that permanence is precisely what most people, Heraclitus included, miss, preoccupied as we are with the mundane comings and goings of the latest trends, fashions, and political currents. The being of the cosmos lies not in its becoming, as Heraclitus thought. Becoming is nothing more than an illusion, the perceptions of mortal minds. What is, for Parmenides, is and cannot not be, while what is not, is not, and cannot be. Neither is it possible to even think of what is not, for to think of anything entails that it must be an object of thought. Thus to meditate on something that is not an object is, for Parmenides, contradictory. Therefore, “for the same thing is for thinking and for being.” (DK28B3)

Being is indivisible; for in order to divide being from itself, one would have to separate being from being by way of something else, either being or not-being. But not-being is not and cannot be, (so not-being cannot separate being from being). And if being is separated from being by way of being, then being itself in this thought-experiment is continuous, that is to say, being is undivided (and indivisible): “for you will not sever being from holding to being.” (DK28B4.2) Being is eternal and unchanging; for if being were to change or become in any way, this would entail that in some sense it had participated or would participate in not-being which is impossible: “How could being perish? How could it come to be?/For if it came to be, it was not, nor if it is ever about to come to be./In this way becoming has been extinguished and destruction is not heard of.” (DK28B8.19-21)

Being, for Parmenides, is thus eternal, unchanging, and indivisible spatially or temporally. Heraclitus might have been right to note the way things appear, (as a constant state of becoming) but he was wrong, on Parmenides’ view, to confuse the way things appear with the way things actually are, or with the “steadfast heart of persuasive truth.” (DK28B1.29) Likewise, Parmenides has argued, thought can only genuinely attend to being—what is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible. Whatever it is that Heraclitus has found in the world of impermanence, it is not, Parmenides holds, philosophy. While unenlightened mortals may attend to the transience of everyday life, the path of genuine wisdom lies in the eternal and unchanging. Thus, while Heraclitus had been the first philosopher of difference, Parmenides is the first to assert explicitly that self-identity, and not difference, is the basis of philosophical thought.

c. Plato

It is these two accounts, the Heraclitean and the Parmenidean (with an emphatic privileging of the latter), that Plato attempts to answer and fuse in his theory of forms. Throughout Plato’s Dialogues, he consistently gives credence to the Heraclitean observation that things in the material world are in a constant state of flux. The Parmenidean inspiration in Plato’s philosophy, however, lies in the fact that, like Parmenides, Plato will explicitly assert that genuine knowledge must concern itself only with that which is eternal and unchanging. So, given the transient nature of material things, Plato will hold that knowledge, strictly speaking, does not apply to material things specifically, but rather, to the Forms (eternal and unchanging) of which those material things are instantiations. In Book V of the Republic, Plato (through Socrates) argues that each human capacity has a matter that is proper exclusively to it. For example, the capacity of seeing has as its proper matter waves of light, while the capacity of hearing has as its proper matter waves of sound. In a proclamation that hearkens almost explicitly to Parmenides, knowledge, Socrates argues, concerns itself with being, while ignorance is most properly affiliated with not-being.

From here, the account continues, (with an eye toward Heraclitus). Everything that exists in the world participates both in being and in not-being. For example, every circle both is and is not “circle.” It is a circle to the extent that we recognize its resemblance, but it is not circle (or the absolute embodiment of what it means to be a circle) because we also recognize that no circle as manifested in the world is a perfect circle. Even the most circular circle in the world will possess minor imperfections, however slight, that will make it not a perfect circle. Thus the things in the world participate both in being and in not-being. (This is the nature of becoming). Since being and not-being each has a specific capacity proper to it, becoming, lying between these two, must have a capacity that is proper only to it. This capacity, he argues, is opinion, which, as is fitting, is that epistemological mode or comportment lying somewhere between knowledge and ignorance.

Therefore, when one’s attention is turned only to the things of the world, she can possess only opinions regarding them. Knowledge, reserved only for that domain of being, that which is and cannot not be, for Plato, applies only to the Form of the thing, or what it means to be x and nothing but x. This Form is an eternal and unchanging reality. If one has knowledge of the Form, then one can evaluate each particular in the world, in order to accurately determine whether or not it in fact accords with the principle in question. If not, one may only have opinions about the thing. For example, if one possesses knowledge of the Form of the beautiful, then one may evaluate particular things in the world—paintings, sculptures, bodies, and so forth—and know whether or not they are in fact beautiful. Lacking this knowledge, however, one may hold opinions as to whether or not a given thing is beautiful, but one will never have genuine knowledge of it. More likely, she will merely possess certain tastes on the matter—(I like this poem; I do not like that painting, and so forth.) This is why Socrates, especially in the earlier dialogues, is adamant that his interlocutors not give him examples in order to define or explain their concepts (a pious action is doing what I am doing now...). Examples, he argues, can never tell me what the Form of the thing is, (such as piety, in the Euthyphro). The philosopher, Plato holds, concerns himself with being, or the essentiality of the Form, as opposed to the lover of opinion, who concerns himself only with the fleeting and impermanent.

From this point, however, things in the Platonic account start to get more complicated. “Participation” is itself a somewhat messy notion that Plato never quite explains in any satisfactory way. After all, what does it mean to say, as Socrates argues in the Republic, that the ring finger participates in the form of the large when compared to the pinky, and in the form of the small when compared to the middle finger? It would seem to imply that a thing’s participation in its relevant Form derives, not from anything specific about its nature, but only insofar as its nature is related to the nature of another thing. But the story gets even more complicated in that at multiple points in his later dialogues, Plato argues explicitly for a Form of the different, which complicates what we typically call Platonism, almost beyond the point of recognition, (see, for example, Theaetetus 186a; Parmenides 143b, 146b, and 153a; and Sophist 254e, 257b, and 259a).

On its face, this should not be surprising. If a finger sometimes participates in the form of the large and sometimes in the form of the small, it should stand to reason that any given thing, when looked at side by side with something similar, will be said to participate in the form of the same, while by extension, when compared to something that differs in nature, will be said to participate in the form of the different—and participate more greatly in the form of the different, the more different the two things are. A baseball, side by side with a softball, will participate greatly in the form of the same, (but somewhat in the Form of the different), but when looked at side by side with a cardboard box, will participate more in the Form of the different.

But consistently articulating what a Form of the different would be is more complicated than it may at first seem. To say that the Form of x is what it means to be x and nothing but x is comprehensible enough, when one is dealing with an isolable characteristic or set of characteristics of a thing. If we say, for instance, that the Form of circle is what it means to be a circle and nothing but a circle, we know that we mean all of the essential characteristics that make a circle, a circle, (a round-plane figure the boundary of which consists of points, equidistant from a center; an arc of 360°, and so forth.). By implication, each individual Form, to the extent that it completely is what it is, also participates equally in the Form of the same, in that it is the same as itself, or it is self-identical. But what can it possibly mean to say that the form of the different is what it means to be different and nothing but different? It would seem to imply that the identity of the form of the different is that it differs, but this requires that it differs even from itself. For if the essence of the different is that it is the same as the different, (in the way that the essence of circle is self-identical to what it means to be circle), then this would entail that the essence of the Form of the different is that, to the same extent that it is different, it participates equally in the Form of the same, (or that, like the rest of the Forms, it is self-identical). But the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same; it must bear nothing of the Form of the same. But this means that the Form of the different must be different from the different as well; put otherwise, while for every other conceivable Platonic Form, one can say that it is self-identical, the Form of the different would be absolutely unique in that its nature would be defined by its self-differentiation.

But there are further complications still. Each Form in Plato’s ontology must relate to every other Form by way of the Form of the different. From this it follows that, just as the Form of the same pervades all the other Forms, (in that each is identical to itself), the Form of the different also pervades all the other Forms, (in that each Form is different from every other). This implies, in some sense, that the different is co-constitutive, along with Plato’s Form of the same, of each other individual Form. After all, part of what makes a thing what it is, (and hence, self-same, or self-identical), is that it differs from everything that it is not. To the extent that the Form of the same makes any given Form what it is, it is commensurably different from every other Form that it is not.

This complication, however, reaches its apogee when we consider the Form of the same specifically. As we said, the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same. The Form of the same differs from all other Forms as well. While, for instance, the Form of the beautiful participates in the Form of the same, (in that the beautiful is the same as the beautiful, or it is self-identical), nevertheless, the Form of the same is different from, (that is, it is not the same as) the Form of the beautiful. The Form of the same differs, similarly, from all other Forms. However, its difference from the Form of the different is a special relation. If the Form of the different is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the same, we can say reciprocally, that the Form of the same is defined by its being absolutely different from the Form of the different; it relates to the different through the different. But this means that, to the extent that the Form of the same is self-same, or self-identical, it is so because it differs absolutely from the Form of the different. This entails, however, that its self-sameness derives from its maximal participation in the Form of the different itself.

We see, then, the danger posed by Plato’s Form of the different, and hence, by any attempt to formulate a concept of difference itself. Plato’s Form of the same is ubiquitous throughout his ontology; it is, in a certain sense, the glue that holds together the rest of the Forms, even if in many of his Middle Period dialogues, it never makes an explicit appearance. Simply by understanding what a Form means for Plato, we can see the central role that the Form of the same plays for this, or for that matter, any other essentialist ontology. By simply introducing a Form of the different, and attempting to rigorously think through its implications, one can see that it threatens to fundamentally undermine the Form of the same itself, and hence by implication, difference threatens to devour the whole rest of the ontological edifice of essentialism. Plato, it seems, was playing with Heraclitean fire. It is likely largely for this reason that Aristotle, Plato’s greatest student, nixes the Form of the different in his Metaphysics.

d. Aristotle

In the Metaphysics, Aristotle attempts to correct what he perceives to be many of Plato’s missteps. For our purposes, what is most important is his treatment of the notion of difference. For Aristotle inserts into the discussion a presupposition that Plato had not employed, namely, that ‘difference’ may be said only of things which are, in some higher sense, identical. Where Plato’s Form of the different may be said to relate everything to everything else, Aristotle argues that there is a conceptual distinction to be made between difference and otherness.

For Aristotle, there are various ways in which a thing may be said to be one, in terms of: (1) Continuity; (2) Wholeness or unity; (3) Number; (4) Kind. The first two are a bit tricky to distinguish, even for Aristotle. By continuity, he means the general sense in which a thing may be said to be a thing. A bundle of sticks, bound together with twine, may be said to be one, even if it is a result of human effort that has made it so. Likewise, an individual body part, such as an arm or leg, may be said to be one, as it has an isolable functional continuity. Within this grouping, there are greater and lesser degrees to which something may be said to be one. For instance, while a human leg may be said to be one, the tibia or the femur, on their own, are more continuous, (in that each is numerically one, and the two of them together form the leg).

With respect to wholeness or unity, Aristotle clarifies the meaning of this as not differing in terms of substratum. Each of the parts of a man, (the legs, the arms, the torso, the head), may be said to be, in their own way, continuous, but taken together, and in harmonious functioning, they constitute the oneness or the wholeness of the individual man and his biological and psychological life. In this sense, the man is one, in that all of his parts function naturally together towards common ends. In the same respect, a shoelace, each eyelet, the sole, and the material comprising the shoe itself, may be said to be, each in their own way, continuous, while taken together, they constitute the wholeness of the shoe.

Oneness in number is fairly straightforward. A man is one in the organic sense above, but he is also one numerically, in that his living body constitutes one man, as opposed to many men. Finally, there is generic oneness, the oneness in kind or in intelligibility. There is a sense in which all human beings, taken together, may be said to be one, in that they are all particular tokens of the genus human. Likewise, humans, cats, dogs, lions, horses, pigs, and so forth, may all be said to be one, in that they are all types of the genus animal.

Otherness is the term that Aristotle uses to characterize existent things which are, in any sense of the term, not one. There is, as we said, a sense in which a horse and a woman are one, (in that both are types of the genus animal), but an obvious sense in which they are other as well. There is a sense in which my neighbor and I are one, (in that we are both tokens of the genus human), but insofar as we are materially, emotionally, and psychologically distinct, there is a sense in which I am other than my neighbor as well. There is an obvious sense in which I and my leg are one but there is also a sense in which my leg is other than me as well, (for if I were to lose my leg in an accident, provided I received prompt and proper medical attention, I would continue to exist). Every existent thing, Aristotle argues, is by its very nature either one with or other than every other existent thing.

But this otherness does not, (as it does for Plato’s Form of the different), satisfy the conditions for what Aristotle understands as difference. Since everything that exists is either one with or other than everything else that exists, there need not be any definite sense in which two things are other. Indeed, there may be, (as we saw above, my neighbor and I are one in the sense of tokens of the genus human, but are other numerically), but there need not be. For instance, you are so drastically other than a given place, say, a cornfield, that we need not even enumerate the various ways in which the two of you are other.

This, however, is the key for Aristotle: otherness is not the same as difference. While you are other than a particular cornfield, you are not different than a cornfield. Difference, strictly speaking, applies only when there is some definite sense in which two things may be said to differ, which requires a higher category of identity within which a distinction may be drawn: “For the other and that which it is other than need not be other in some definite respect (for everything that is existent is either other or same), but that which is different is different from some particular thing in some particular respect, so that there must be something identical whereby they differ. And this identical thing is genus or species...” (Metaphysics, X.3) In other words, two human beings may be different, (that is, one may be taller, lighter-skinned, a different gender, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specific members of the genus ‘human.’ A human being may be different than a cat, (that is, one is quadripedal while the other is bipedal, one is non-rational while the other is rational, and so forth), but this is because they are identical in the sense that both are specified members of the genus ‘animal.’

But between these two, generic and specific, specific difference or contrariety is, according to Aristotle, the greatest, most perfect, or most complete. This assessment too is rooted in Aristotle’s emphasis on identity as the basis of differentiation. Differing in genus in Aristotelian terminology means primarily belonging to different categories of being, (substance, time, quality, quantity, place, relation, and so forth.) You are other than ‘5,’ to be sure, but Aristotle would not say that you are different from ‘5,’ because you are a substance and ‘5’ is a quantity and given that these two are distinct categories of being, for Aristotle there is not really a meaningful sense in which they can be said to relate, and hence, there is not a meaningful sense in which they can be said to differ. Things that differ in genus are so far distant (closer, really, to otherness), as to be nearly incomparable. However, a man may be said to be different than a cat, because the characteristics whereby they are distinguished from each other are contrarieties, occupying opposing sides of a given either/or, for instance, rational v. non-rational. Special difference or contrariety thus provides us with an affirmation or a privation, a ‘yes’ or a ‘no’ that constitutes the greatest difference, according to Aristotle. Differences in genus are too great, while differences within species are too minute and numerous (skin color, for instance, is manifested in an infinite myriad of ways), but special contrariety is complete, embodying an affirmation or negation of a particular given quality whereby genera are differentiated into species.

There are thus two senses in which, for Aristotle, difference is thought only in accordance with a principle of identity. First, there is the identity that two different things share within a common genus. (A rock and a tree are identical in that both are members of the genus, ‘substance,’ differentiated by the contrariety of ‘living/non-living.’) Second, there is the identity of the characteristic whereby two things are differentiated: material (v. non-material), living (v. non-living), sentient (v. non-sentient), rational (v. irrational), and so forth.

We see, then, that with Aristotle, difference becomes fully codified within the tradition as the type of empirical difference that we mentioned at the outset of this article: it is understood as a recognizable relation between two things which, prior to (and independently of) their relating, possess their own self-contained identities. This difference then is a way in which a thing A, (which is identical to itself) is not like a thing B (which is identical to itself), while both belong to a higher category of identity, (in the sense of an Aristotelian genus). Given the difficulties that we encountered with Plato’s attempt to think a Form of the different, it is perhaps little wonder that Aristotle’s understanding of difference was left unchallenged for nearly two and a half millennia.

2. Key Themes of Differential Ontology

As noted in the Introduction, differential ontology is a term that can be applied to two specific thinkers (Deleuze and Derrida) of the late twentieth century, along with those philosophers who have followed in the wakes of these two. It is, nonetheless, not applicable as a school of thought, in that there is not an identifiable doctrine or set of doctrines that define what they think. Indeed, for as many similarities that one can find between them, there are likely equally many distinctions as well. They work out of different philosophical traditions: Derrida primarily from the Hegel-Husserl-Heidegger triumvirate, with Deleuze, (speaking critically of the phenomenological tradition for the most part) focusing on the trinity of Spinoza-Nietzsche-Bergson. Theologically, they are interested in different sources, with Derrida giving constant nods to thinkers in the tradition of negative theology, such as Meister Eckhart, while Deleuze is interested in the tradition of univocity, specifically in John Duns Scotus. They have different attitudes toward the history of metaphysics, with Derrida working out of the Heideggerian platform of the supposed end of metaphysics, while Deleuze explicitly rejects all talk of any supposed end of metaphysics. They hold different attitudes toward their own philosophical projects, with Derrida coining the term, (following Heidegger’s Destruktion), deconstruction, while for Deleuze, philosophy is always a constructivism. In many ways, it is difficult to find two thinkers who are less alike than Deleuze and Derrida. Nevertheless, what makes them both differential ontologists is that they are working within a framework of specific thematic critiques and assumptions, and that on the basis of these factors, both come to argue that difference in itself has never been recognized as a legitimate object of philosophical thought, to hold that identities are always constituted, on the basis of difference in itself, and to explicitly attempt to formulate such a concept. Let us now look to these thematic, structural elements.

a. Immanence

The word immanence is contrasted with the word transcendence. “Transcendence” means going beyond, while “immanence” means remaining within, and these designations refer to the realm of experience. In most monotheistic religious traditions, for instance, which emphasize creation ex nihilo, God is said to be transcendent in the sense that He exists apart from His creation. God is the source of nature, but God is not, Himself, natural, nor is he found within anything in nature except perhaps in the way in which one might see reflections of an artist in her work of art. Likewise God does not, strictly speaking, resemble any created thing. God is eternal, while created beings are temporal; God is without beginning, while created things have a beginning; God is a necessary being, while created things are contingent beings; God is pure spirit, while created things are material. The creature closest in nature to God is the human being who, according to the Biblical book of Genesis, is created in the image of God, but even in this case, God is not to be understood as resembling human beings: “For my thoughts are not your thoughts, neither are my ways your ways...” (Isaiah 55:8).

In this sense, we can say that historically, the trend in Eastern philosophies and religions (which are not as radically differentiated as they are in the Western tradition), has always leaned much more in the direction of immanence than of transcendence, and definitely more so than nearly all strains of Western monotheism. In schools of Eastern philosophy that have some notion of the divine (and a great many of them do not), many if not most understand the divine as somehow embodied or manifested within the world of nature. Such a position would be considered idolatrous in most strains of Western monotheism.

With respect to the Western philosophical tradition specifically, we can say that, even in moments when religious tendencies and doctrines do not loom large, (like they do, for instance, during the Medieval period), there nevertheless remains a dominant model of transcendence throughout, though this transcendence is emphasized in greater and lesser degrees across the history of philosophy. There have been outliers, to be sure—Heraclitus comes to mind, along with Spinoza and perhaps David Hume, but they are rare. A philosophy rooted in transcendence will, in some way, attempt to ground or evaluate life and the world on the basis of principles or criteria not found (indeed not discoverable de jure) among the living or in the world. When Parmenides asserts that the object of philosophical thought must be that which is, and which cannot not be, which is eternal, unchanging, and indivisible, he is describing something beyond the realm of experience. When Plato claims that genuine knowledge is found only in the Form; when he argues in the Phaedo that the philosophical life is a preparation for death; that one must live one’s life turning away from the desires of the body, in the purification of the spirit; when he alludes, (through the mouth of Socrates) to life as a disease, he is basing the value of this world on a principle not found in the world. When St. Paul writes that “...the flesh lusts against the Spirit, and the Spirit against the flesh; and these are contrary to one another, so that you do not do the things you wish” (Galatians 5:17), and that “the mind governed by the flesh is death,” (Romans 8:6), he is evaluating this world against another. When René Descartes recognizes his activity of thinking and finds therein a soul; when John Locke bases Ideas upon a foundation of primary qualities, immanent, allegedly, to the thing, but transcendent to our experience; when Immanuel Kant bases phenomenal appearances upon noumenal realities, which, outside of space, time, and all causality, ever elude cognition; when an ethical thinker seeks a moral law, or an absolute principle of the good against which human behaviors may be evaluated; in each of these cases, a transcendence of some sort is posited—something not found within the world is sought in order to make sense of or provide a justification for this world.

Famously, Friedrich Nietzsche argued that the history of philosophy was one of the true world finally becoming a fable. Tracing the notion of the true world from its sagely Platonic (more accurately, Parmenidean) inception up through and beyond its Kantian (noumenal) manifestation, he demonstrates that as the demand for certainty (the will to Truth) intensifies, the so-called true world becomes less plausible, slipping further and further away, culminating in the moment he called “the death of God.” The true world has now been abolished, leaving only the apparent world. But the world was only ever called apparent by comparison with a purported true world (think here of Parmenides’ castigation of Heraclitus). Thus, when the true world is abolished, the apparent world is abolished as well; and we are left with only the world, nothing more than the world.

One of the key features of differential ontology will be the adoption of Nietzsche’s proclaimed (and reclaimed) enthusiasm for immanence. Deleuze and Derrida will, each in his own way, argue that philosophy must find its basis within and take as its point of departure the notion of immanence. As we shall see below, in Deleuze’s philosophy, this emphasis on immanence will take the form of his enthusiasm for the Scotist doctrine of the univocity of being. For Derrida, it will be his lifelong commitment to the phenomenological tradition, inspired by the vast body of research conducted over nearly half a century by Edmund Husserl, out of which Derrida’s professional research platform began, (and in which he discovers the notion of différance).

b. Time as Differential

Related to the privileging of immanence is the second principle of central importance to differential ontology, a careful and rigorous analysis of time. Such analysis, inspired by Edmund Husserl, will yield the discovery of a differential structure, which stands in opposition to the traditional understanding of time, the spatially organized, puncti-linear model of time. This refers to a conglomeration of various elements from Plato, Aristotle, St. Augustine, Boethius, and ultimately, the Modern period.

Few thinkers have attempted so rigorously as Aristotle to think the paradoxical nature of time. If we take the very basic model of time as past-present-future, Aristotle notes that one part of this (the past), has been but is no more, while another part of it (the future) will be but is not yet. There is an inherent difficulty, therefore, in trying to understand what time is, because it seems as though it is composed of parts made up of things that do not exist; therefore, we are attempting to understand what something that does not exist, is.

Furthermore, the present or the now itself, for Aristotle, is not a part of time, because a part is so called because of its being a constitutive element of a whole. However, time, Aristotle claims, is not made up of nows, in the same way that a line, though it has points, is not made up of points.

Likewise, the now cannot simply remain the same, but nor can it be said to be discrete from other nows and ever-renewed. For if the now is ever the same, then everything that has ever happened is contained within the present now, (which seems absurd); but if each now is discrete, and is constantly displaced by another discrete, self-contained now, the displacement of the old now would have to take place within (or simultaneously with) the new, incoming now, which would be impossible, as discrete nows cannot be simultaneous; hence time as such would never pass.

Aristotle will therefore claim that there is a sense in which the now is constantly the same, and another sense in which it is constantly changing. The now is, Aristotle argues, both a link of and the limit between future and past. It connects future and past, but is at the same time the end of the past and the beginning of the future; but the future and the past lie on opposite sides of the now, so the now cannot, strictly speaking, belong either to the past or to the future. Rather, it divides the past from the future. The essence of the now is this division—as such, the now itself is indivisible, “the indivisible present ‘now’.” (Physics IV.13). Insofar as each now succeeds another in a linear movement from future to past, the now is ever-changing—what is predicated of the now is constantly filled out in an ever-new way. But structurally speaking, inasmuch as the now is always that which divides and unites future and past, it is constantly the same.

Without the now, there would be no time, Aristotle argues, and vice versa. For what we call time is merely the enumeration that takes place in the progression of history between some moment, future or past, relative to the now moment: “For time is just this—number of motion in respect of ‘before’ and ‘after’.” (Physics, IV.11)

Here, then, are the elements that Aristotle leaves us with: an indivisible now moment that serves as the basis of the measure of time, which is a progression of enumeration taking place between moments, and a notion of relative distance that marks that progression of enumeration.

In Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius, we find an important distinction between time and eternity: (it is important to note that Aristotle’s discussion of time is found in his Physics, not in his Metaphysics, because time, as the measure of change, belongs only to the things of nature, not to the divine). The reason that this is an important distinction for our purposes is that eternity, (for Plato, Augustine, and Boethius), is the perspective of the divine, while temporality is the perspective of creation. Eternity, for all three of these thinkers, does not mean passing through every moment of time in the sense of having always been there, and always being there throughout every moment of the future, (which is called ‘sempiternity’). All three of these philosophers view time as itself a created thing, and eternity, the perspective of the divine, stands outside of time.

Having created the entire spectrum of time, and standing omnisciently outside of time, the divine sees the whole of time, in an ever-present now. This complete fullness of the now is how Plato, St. Augustine, and Boethius understand eternity. Once we have made this move, however, it is a very short leap to the conclusion that, in a sense, all of time is ever-present; certainly not from our perspective, but from the perspective of the divine. In other words, right now, in an ever-present now, God is seeing the exodus of the Israelites, the sacking of Troy, the execution of Socrates, the crucifixion of Jesus, the fall of the Roman Empire, and the moment (billions of years from now) that the sun will become a Red Giant. Therefore, what we call the now is, on this model, no more or less significant, and no more or less NOW, than any other moment in time. It only appears to be so, from our very limited, finite perspectives. From the perspective of eternity, however, each present is equally present. Plato refers to time in the Timaeus as a “moving image of eternity.” (Timaeus, 37d)

The final piece of the puncti-linear model of time comes from the historical moment of the scientific revolution, with the conceptual birth of absolute time. On the Modern view, time is not the Aristotelian measure of change; rather, the measure of change is how we typically perceive time. Time, in and of itself, however, just is, in the same way that space, on the Modern view, just is—it is mathematical, objectively uniform and unitary, and the same in all places, its units (or moments) unfolding with precise regularity. Though the term “absolute time” was officially introduced by Sir Isaac Newton in his Philosophiae Naturalis Principia Mathematica (1687), as that which “from its own nature flows equably without regard to anything external,” it is nevertheless clear that the experiments and theories of both Johannes Kepler and Galileo Galilei (both of whom historically preceded Newton) assume a model of absolute time. None other than René Descartes, the philosopher who did more than any other to usher in the modern sciences, writes in the third of his famous Meditations on First Philosophy, (where he argues for the existence of God) “for the whole time of my life may be divided into an infinity of parts, each of which is in no way dependent on any other...”

The puncti-linear model of time, then, conceives the whole of time as a series of now-points, or moments, each of which makes up something like an atom of time (as the physical atom is a unit of space). Each of those moments is ontologically and logically independent of every other, with the present moment being the now-point most alive. The past, then, is conceived as those presents that have come and gone, while the future is conceived as those presents that have not yet come, and insofar as we speak of past and future moments as occupying points of greater and lesser distances with respect to the present and to each other as well, we are, whether we realize it or not, conceiving of time as a linear progression; thus when we attempt to understand the essence of time, we tend to conceptually spatialize it. This prejudice is most easily seen in the ease with which our mind leaps to timelines in order to conceptualize relations of historical events.

Edmund Husserl, whose 1904-1905 lectures On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time probably did more to shape the future of the continental tradition in philosophy in the twentieth century than any other single text, was also very influential on the issue of time consciousness. There, Husserl constructs a model of time consciousness that he calls “the living present.” Whether or not there is any such thing as real time, or absolute time is, for Husserl, one of those questions that is bracketed in the performance of the phenomenological epochē; time, for Husserl, as everything else, is to be analyzed in terms of its objective qualities, in other words, in terms of how it is lived by a constituting subject. Husserl’s point of departure is to object to the theory of experience offered by Husserl’s mentor, Franz Brentano. Assuming (though not making explicit) the puncti-linear model of time, Brentano distinguishes between two basic types of experience. The primary mode is perception, which is the consciousness of the present now-point. All modes of the past are understood in terms of memory, which is the imagined recollection or representation of a now-moment no longer present. If you are asked to call to mind your celebration of your tenth birthday, you are employing the faculty of memory. And every mode of experience dealing with the past (or the no-longer-present), is understood by Brentano as memory.

This understanding presents a problem, though. From the moment you began reading the first word of this sentence, from, until this moment right now, as you are reading these words, there is a type of memory being employed. Indeed, in order to genuinely experience any given experience as an experience, and not just a random series of moments, there must be some operation of memory taking place. To cognize a song as a song, rather than a random series of notes, we must have some memory of the notes that have come just before, and so on. However, the type of memory that is being used here seems to be qualitatively different than the sort of memory employed when you are encouraged to reflect upon your tenth birthday, or even, to reflect upon what you had for dinner last night. This type of reflection, (or representation) is a calling-back-to-mind of an event that was experienced at some point in the past, but has long since left consciousness, while the other (the sort of memory it takes to cognize a sentence or a paragraph, for instance), is an operative memory of an event that has not yet left consciousness. Both are modes of memory, to be sure, but they are qualitatively different modes of memory, Husserl argues.

Moreover, in each moment of experience, we are at the same time looking forward to the future in some mode of expectation. This, too, is something we experience on a frequent basis. For instance, when walking through a door that we walk through frequently, we might casually tap the handle and lead with our head and shoulders because we expect that the door, unlocked, will open for us as it always does; when sitting at the bus stop, as the bus approaches the curb, we stand, because we expect that it is our bus, and that it is stopping to let us on. Our expectations are not quite as salient as are our primary memories, but they are there. All it takes is a rupture of some sort—the door may be locked, causing us to hit our head; the bus may not be our bus, or the driver may not see us and may continue driving—to realize that the structure of expectation was present in our consciousness.

Time, Husserl argues, is not experienced as a series of discrete, independent moments that arise and instantly die; rather, experience of the present is always thick with past and future. What Aristotle refers to as the now, Husserl calls the ‘primal impression,’ the moment of impact between consciousness and its intentional object, which is ever-renewed, but also ever-passing away; but the primal impression is constantly surrounded by a halo of retention (or primary memory) and protention (primary expectation). This structure, taken altogether, is what Husserl calls, “the living present.”

Derrida and Deleuze will each employ (while subjecting to strident criticism) Husserl’s concept of the living present. If the present is always constituted as a relation of past to future, then the very nature of time is itself relational, that is to say, it cannot be conceived as points on a line or as seconds on a clock. If time is essentially or structurally relational, then everything we think about ‘things’ (insofar as things are constituted in time), and knowledge (insofar as it takes place in time), will be radically transformed as well. To fully think through the implications of Husserl’s discovery entails a fundamental reorientation toward time and along with it, being. Deleuze employs the retentional-protentional structure of time, while discarding the notion of the primal impression. Derrida will stick with the terms of Husserl’s structure, while demonstrating that the present in Husserl is always infected with or contaminated by the non-present, the structure of which Derrida calls différance.

c. Critique of Essentialist Metaphysics

In a sense it is difficult to talk in a synthetic way about what Deleuze and Derrida find wrong with traditional metaphysics, because they each, in the context of their own specific projects, find distinct problems with the history of metaphysics. However, the following is clear: (1) If we can use the term ‘metaphysics’ to characterize the attempt to understand the fundamental nature of things, and; (2) If we can acknowledge that traditionally the effort to do that has been carried out through the lenses of representational thinking in some form or other, then; (3) the critiques that Deleuze and Derrida offer against the history of metaphysical thinking are centered around the point that traditional metaphysics ultimately gets things wrong.

For Deleuze, this will come down to a necessary and fundamental imprecision that accompanies traditional metaphysics. Inasmuch as the task of metaphysics is to think the nature of the thing, and inasmuch as it sets for itself essentialist parameters for doing so, it necessarily filters its own understanding of the thing through conceptual representations, philosophy can never arrive at an adequate concept of the individual. To our heart’s desire, we may compound and multiply the concepts that we use to characterize a thing, but there will always necessarily be some aspect of that thing left untouched by thinking. Let us use a simple example, an inflated ball—we can describe it by as many representational concepts as we like: it is a certain color or a certain pattern, made of a certain material (rubber or plastic, perhaps), a certain size, it has a certain degree of elasticity, is filled with a certain amount of air, and so forth. However many categories or concepts we may apply to this ball, the nature of this ball itself will always elude us. Our conceptual characterization will always reach a terminus; our concepts can only go so far down. The ball is these characterizations, but it is also different from its characterizations as well. For Deleuze, if our ontology cannot reach down to the thing itself, if it is structurally and essentially incapable of comprehending the constitution of the thing, (as any substance metaphysics will be), then it is, for the most part, worthless as an ontology.

Derrida casts his critiques of the history of metaphysics in the Heideggerian language of presence. The history of philosophy, Derrida argues, is the metaphysics of presence, and the Western religious and philosophical tradition operates by categorizing being according to conceptual binaries: (good/evil, form/matter, identity/difference, subject/object, voice/writing, soul/body, mind/body, invisible/visible, life/death, God/Satan, heaven/earth, reason/passion, positive/negative, masculine/feminine, true/apparent, light/dark, innocence/fallenness, purity/contamination, and so forth.) Metaphysics consists of first establishing the binary, but from the moment it is established, it is already clear which of the two terms will be considered the good term and which the pejorative term—the good term is the one that is conceptually analogous to presence in either its spatial or temporal sense. The philosopher’s task, then, is to isolate the presence as the primary term, and to conceptually purge it of its correlative absent term.

A few examples will help elucidate this point: for Parmenides, divine wisdom entails an attempt to think that which is, at every present moment, the same. Heraclitean flux is the way of the masses. This in part shapes Plato’s emphasis on the eternality of the Form—while the material world changes with the passage of each new present, the Form remains the same, (ever-present or eternal); but in addition, the Form is also that which is closest to (a term of presence) the nature of the soul. In Plato the body, (given that it is in constant flux), is the prison of the soul, and in the Phaedo, life is declared a disease, for which death is the cure. In Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, the most complete happiness for the human being lies in the life of contemplation, because the capacity for contemplation is that which makes us most like the gods, (who are ever the same). So we would be happiest if we could contemplate all the time; however, we unfortunately cannot (as we also have bodies and so, various familial, social, and political responsibilities). In Christianity, the flesh is subject to change (which is the very essence of corruptibility) while the Spirit is incorruptible (or ever-present); for Descartes, (and for the early phenomenological tradition), only what is spatially present (that is, immediate to consciousness), is indubitable. Whether or not the object of my present perception exists in the so-called real world, it is nevertheless indubitable that I am experiencing what I am experiencing, in the moment at which I am experiencing it—Descartes even goes so far as to define clarity (one of his conditions for ‘truth’) as that which is present. And for Descartes, the body (insofar as it is at least possible to doubt its existence), is not most essentially me; rather, my soul is what I am. We saw Aristotle’s emphasis on the now, or the present, as the yardstick against which time is measured. The spatial and temporal senses of the emphasis on presence are completely solidified in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, whose phenomenological reduction attempts to focus its attention exclusively on the phenomena of consciousness, because only then can it accord with the philosophical demand for apodicticity; and he understands this experience as constituted on the model of the living present. In each of these cases, a presence is valorized, and its correlative absence is suppressed.

As was the case with Deleuze, however, Derrida will argue that the self-proclaimed task of metaphysics ultimately fails. Thus, (and against some of his more dismissive critics), Derrida operates in the name of truth—when the history of metaphysics posits that presence is primary, and absence secondary, this claim, Derrida shows, is false. Metaphysics, in all of its manifestations, attempts to cast out the impure, but somehow, the impure always returns, in the form of a supplementary term; the secondary term is always ultimately required in order to supplement the primary term. Derrida’s project then is dedicated to demonstrating that if the subordinate term is required in order to supplement the so-called primary term, it can only be because the primary term suffers always and originally from a lack or a deficiency of some sort. In other words, the absence that philosophy sought to cast out was present and infecting the present term from the origin.

3. Key Differential Ontologists

a. Jacques Derrida as a Differential Ontologist

It is in the phenomenology of Edmund Husserl, as we said above, that Derrida discovers the constitutive play known as différance. In its effort to isolate ideal essences, constituted within the sphere of consciousness, phenomenology brackets or suspends all questions having to do with the real existence of the external world, the belief in which Husserl refers to as the natural attitude. The natural attitude is the non-thematic subjective attitude that takes for granted the real existence of the real world, absent and apart from my (or any) experience of it. Science or philosophy, in the mode of the natural attitude, ontologically distinguishes being from our perceptions of being, from which point it becomes impossible to ever again bridge the gap between the two. Try as it might, philosophy in the natural attitude can only ever have representations of being, and certainty (the telos of philosophical activity) becomes untenable. With this in mind, we get Husserl’s famous principle of all principles: “that everything originarily… offered to us in ‘intuition’ is to be accepted simply as what it is presented as being, but also only within the limits in which it is presented there.” (Ideas I, §24) Husserl thus proposes a change in attitude, in what he calls the phenomenological epochē, which suspends all questions regarding the external existence of the objects of consciousness, along with the constituting priority of the empirical self. Both self and world are bracketed, revealing the correlative structure of the world itself in relation to consciousness thereof, opening a sphere of pure immanence, or, in Derrida’s terminology, pure presence. It is for this reason that Husserl represents for Derrida the most strident defense of the metaphysics of presence, and it is for this reason that his philosophy also serves as the ground out of which the notion of constitutive difference is discovered.

In his landmark 1967 text, Voice and Phenomenon, Derrida takes on Husserl’s notion of the sign. The sign, we should note, is typically understood as a stand-in for something that is currently absent. Linguistically a sign is a means by which a speaker conveys to a listener the meaning that currently resides within the inner experience of the speaker. The contents of one person’s experience cannot be transferred or related to the experience of a listener except through the usage of signs, (which we call ‘language’). Knowing this, and knowing that Husserl’s philosophy is an attempt to isolate a pure moment of presence, it is little wonder that he wants, inasmuch as it is possible, to do away with the usage of signs, and isolate an interior moment of presence. It is precisely this aim that Derrida takes apart.

In the opening chapter of Husserl’s First Logical Investigation, titled “Essential Distinctions,” Husserl draws a distinction between different types or functions of signs: expressions and indications. He claims signs are always pointing to something, but what they point to can assume different forms. An indication signifies without pointing to a sense or a meaning. The flu or bodily infection, for instance, is not the meaning of the fever, but it is brought to our attention by way of the fever—the fever, that is, points to an ailment in the body. An expression, however, is a sign that is, itself, charged with conceptual meaning; it is a linguistic sign. There are countless types of signs—animal tracks in the snow point to the recent presence of life, a certain aroma in the house may indicate that a certain food or even a certain ethnicity of food, is being prepared—but expressions are signs that are themselves meaningful.

This distinction (indication/expression) is itself problematic, however, and does not seem to be fundamentally sustainable. An indication may very well be an expression, and expressions are almost always indications. If one’s significant other leaves one a note on the table, for instance, before one has even read the words on the paper, the sheer presence of writing, left in a certain way, on a sheet of paper, situated a certain way on the table, indicates: (1) That the beloved is no longer in the house, and; (2) That the beloved has left one a message to be read. These signs are both indications and expressions. Furthermore, every time we use an expression of some sort, we are indicating something, namely, we are pointing toward an ideal meaning, empirical states of affairs, and so forth. In effect, one would be hard pressed to find a single example of a use of an expression that was not, in some sense, indicative.

Husserl, however, will argue that even if, in fact, expressions are always caught up in an indicative function, that this has nothing to do with the essential distinction, obtaining de jure (if not de facto) between indications and expressions. Husserl cannot relinquish this conviction because, after all, he is attempting to isolate a pure moment of self-presence of meaning. So if expressions are signs charged with meaning, then Husserl will be compelled to locate a pure form of expression, which will require the absolute separation of the expression from its indicative function. Indeed he thinks that this is possible. The reason expressions are almost always indicative is that we use them to communicate with others, and in the going-forth of the sign into the world, some measure of the meaning is always lost—no matter how many signs we use to articulate our experience, the experience can never be perfectly and wholly recreated within the mind of the listener. So to isolate the expressive essence of the expression, we must suspend the going-forth of the sign into the world. This is accomplished in the soliloquy of the inner life of consciousness.

In one’s interior monologue, there is nothing empirical, (nothing from the world), and hence, nothing indicative. The signs themselves have only ideal, not real, existence. Likewise, the signs employed in the interior monologue are not indicative in the way that signs in everyday communication are. Communicative expressions point us to states of affairs or the internal experiences of another person; in short, they point us to empirical events. Expressions of the interior monologue, however, do not point us to empirical realities, but rather, Husserl claims that in the interior expression, the sign points away from itself, and toward its ideal sense. For Husserl, therefore, the purest, most meaningful mode of expression is one in which nothing is, strictly speaking, expressed to anyone.

One might nevertheless wonder, is it not the case, that when one ‘converses’ internally with oneself, that one is, in some sense, articulating meaning to oneself? Here is a mundane example, one which has happened to each of us at some point in time: we walk into a room, and forget why we have entered the room. “Why did I come in here?” we might silently utter to ourselves, and after a moment, we might say to ourselves, “Ah, yes, I came in here to turn down the thermostat,” or something of the like. Is it not the case that the individual is communicating something to herself in this monologue?

Husserl responds in the negative. The signs we are using are not making known to the self a content that was previously inaccessible to the self, (which is what takes place in communication). In pointing away from itself and directly toward the sense, the sense is not conveyed from a self to a self, but rather, the sense of the expression is experienced by the subject at exactly that same moment in time.

This is where Derrida brings into the discussion Husserl’s notion of the living present, for this emphasis on the exact same moment in time relies upon Husserl’s notion of the primal impression. Derrida writes, “The sharp point of the instant, the identity of lived-experience present to itself in the same instant bears therefore the whole weight of this demonstration.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 51). In our discussion above of Husserl’s living present, we saw that the primal impression is constantly displaced by a new primal impression—it is in constant motion. Nevertheless, this does not keep Husserl from referring to the primal impression in terms of a point; it is, he says, the source-point on the basis of which retention is established. While the primal impression is always, as we saw with Husserl, surrounded by a halo of retention and protention, nevertheless this halo is always thought from the absolute center of the primal impression, as the source-point of experience. It is the “non-displaceable center, an eye or living nucleus” of temporality. (Voice and Phenomenon, 53)

This, we note, is the Husserlian manifestation of the emphasis on the temporal sense of presence in the philosophical tradition. Here, we should also note: Derrida never attempts to argue that philosophy should move away from the emphasis on presence. The philosophical tradition is defined by, Derrida claims, its emphasis on the present; the present provides the very foundation of certainty throughout the history of philosophy; it is certainty, in a sense. The present comprises an ineliminable essential element of the whole endeavor of philosophy. So to call it into question is not to try to bring a radical transformation to philosophy, but to shift one’s vantage point to one that inhabits the space between philosophy and non-philosophy. Indeed, Derrida motions in this direction, which is one of the reasons that Derrida is more comfortable than many traditional academic philosophers writing in the style of and in communication with literary figures. The emphasis on presence within philosophy, strictly speaking is incontestable.

Husserl, we saw, formulated his notion of the living present on the basis of his insistence on a qualitative distinction between retention as a mode of memory still connected to the present moment of consciousness, and representational memory, that deliberately calls to mind a moment of the past that has, since its occurrence, left consciousness. This means, for Husserl, that retention must be understood in the mode of Presentation, as opposed to Representation. Retention is a direct intuition of what has just passed, directly presented, and fully seen, in the moment of the now, as opposed to represented memory, which is not. Retention is not, strictly speaking, the present; the primal impression is the present. Nevertheless, retention is still attached to the moment of the now. Furthermore, there is a sense in which retention is necessary to give us the experience of the present as such. The primal impression, where the point of contact occurs, is in a constant mode of passing away, and the impression only becomes recognizable in the mode of retention—as we said, to truly experience a song as a song entails that one must keep in one’s memory the preceding few notes; but this is just another way of saying that the present is constituted in part on the basis of memory, even if memory of what has just passed.

Derrida diagnoses, then, a tension operating at the heart of Husserl’s thinking. On the one hand, Husserl’s phenomenology requires the sharp point of the instant in order to have a pure moment of self-presence, wherein meaning, without the intermediary of signs, can be found. In this sense, retention, though primary memory, is memory nonetheless, and does not give us the present, but is rather, Husserl claims, the “antithesis of perception.” (On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time, 41) Nevertheless, the present as such is only ever constituted on the basis of its becoming concretized and solidified in the acts that constitute the stretching out of time, in retention. Moreover, given that retention is still essentially connected to the primal impression, (which is itself always in the mode of passing away) there is not a radical distinction between retention and primal impression; rather, they are continuous, and the primal impression is really only, Husserl claims, an ideal limit. There is thus a continual accommodation of Husserlian presence to non-presence, which entails the admission of a form of otherness into the self-present now-point of experience. This accommodation is what keeps fundamentally distinct memory as retention and memory as representation.

Nevertheless, the common root, making possible both retention and representational memory, is the structural possibility of repetition itself, which Derrida calls the trace. The trace is the mark of otherness, or the necessary relation of interiority to exteriority. Husserl’s living present is marked by the structure of the trace, Derrida argues, because the primal impression for Husserl, never occurs without a structural retention attached to it. Thus, in the very moment, the selfsame point of time, when the primal impression is impressed within experience, what is essentially necessary to the structure, (in other words, not an accidental feature thereof), is the repeatability of the primal impression within retention. To be experienced in a primal impression therefore requires that the object of experience be repeatable, such that it can mark itself within the mode of retention, and ultimately, representational memory. Thus the primal impression is traced with exteriority, or non-presence, before it is ever empirically stamped.

On the basis of this trace that constitutes the presence of the primal impression, Derrida introduces the concept of différance:

[T]he trace in the most universal sense, is a possibility that must not only inhabit the pure actuality of the now, but must also constitute it by means of the very movement of the différance that the possibility inserts into the pure actuality of the now. Such a trace is, if we are able to hold onto this language without contradicting it and erasing it immediately, more ‘originary’ than the phenomenological originarity itself... In all of these directions, the presence of the present is thought beginning from the fold of the return, beginning from the movement of repetition and not the reverse. Does not the fact that this fold in presence or in self-presence is irreducible, that this trace or this différance is always older than presence and obtains for it its openness, forbid us from speaking of a simple self-identity ‘im selben Augenblick’? (Voice and Phenomenon, 58)

Différance, Derrida says, is a movement, a differentiating movement, on the basis of which the presence (the ground of philosophical certainty) is opened up. The self-presence of subjectivity, in which certainty is established, is inseparable from an experience of time, and the structural essentialities of the experience of time are marked by the trace. It is more originary than the primordiality of phenomenological experience, because it is what makes it possible in the first place. From this it follows, Derrida claims, that Husserl’s project of locating a moment of pure presence will be necessarily thwarted, because in attempting to rigorously think it through, we have found hiding behind it this strange structure signifying a movement and hence, not a this, that Derrida calls différance.

Using Derrida’s terminology, (which we shall presently dissect), we can say that différance is the non-originary, constituting-disruption of presence. Let us take this bit by bit. Différance is constituting—this signifies, as we saw in Husserl, that it is on the basis of this movement that presence is constituted. Derrida claims that it is the play of différance that makes possible all modes of presence, including the binary categories and concepts in accordance with which philosophy, since Plato, has conducted itself. That it is constitutive does not, however, mean that it is originary, at least not without qualification. To speak of origins, for Derrida, implies an engagement with a presumed moment of innocence or purity, in other words, a moment of presence, from which our efforts at meaning have somehow fallen away. Derrida says, rather, that différance is a “non-origin which is originary.” (“Freud and the Scene of Writing,” Writing and Difference, 203) Différance is, in a sense, an origin, but one that is already, at the origin, contaminated; hence it is a non-originary origin.

At the same time, because différance as play and movement always underlie the constitutive functioning of philosophical concepts, it likewise always attenuates this functioning, even as it constitutes it. Différance prevents the philosophical concepts from ever carrying out fully the operations that their author intends them to carry out. This constituting-disruption is the source of one of Derrida’s more (in)famous descriptions of the deconstructive project: “But this condition of possibility turns into a condition of impossibility.” (Of Grammatology, 74)

Différance attenuates both senses of presence to which we referred above: (1) Spatially, it differs, creating spaces, ruptures, chasms, and differences, rather than the desired telos of absolute proximity; (2) Temporally, it defers, delaying presence from ever being fully attained. Thus it is that Derrida, capitalizing on the “two motifs of the Latin differre...” will understand différance in the dual sense of differing and deferring (“Différance,” in Margins of Philosophy, 8)

Derrida is therefore a differential ontologist in that, through his critiques of the metaphysical tradition, he attempts to think the fundamental explicitly on the basis of a differential structure, reading the canonical texts of the philosophical tradition both with and against the intentions of their authors. In so doing, he attempts to expose the play of force underlying the constitution of meaning, and thereby, to open new trajectories of thinking, rethinking the very concept of the concept, and forging a path “toward the unnameable.” (Voice and Phenomenon, 66)

b. Gilles Deleuze as a Differential Ontologist

As early as 1954, in one of Deleuze’s first publications, (a review of Jean Hyppolite’s book, Logic and Existence), Deleuze stresses the urgency for an ontology of pure difference, one that does not rely upon the notion of negation, because negation is merely difference, pushed to its outermost limit. An ontology of pure difference means an attempt to think difference as pure relation, rather than as a not-.

The reason for this urgency, as we saw above, is that the task of philosophy is to have a direct relation to things, and in order for this to happen, philosophy needs to grasp the thing itself, and this means, the thing as it differs from everything else that it is not, the thing as it essentially is. Reason, he claims, must reach down to the level of the individual. In other words, philosophy must attempt to think what he calls internal difference, or difference internal to Being itself. Above we noted that however many representational concepts we may adduce in order to characterize a thing, (our example above was a ball), so long as we are using concepts rooted in identity to grasp it, we will still be unable to think down to the level of what makes this, this. Therefore, philosophy suffers from an essential imprecision, which only differential ontology can repair.

This imprecision is rooted, Deleuze argues, in the Aristotelian moment, specifically in Aristotle’s metaphysics of analogy. Aristotle’s notion of metaphysics as first philosophy is that, while other sciences concentrate on one or another domain of being, metaphysics is to be the science of being qua being. Unlike every other science, (which all study some genus or species of being), the object of the metaphysical science, being qua being, is not a genus. This is because any given genus is differentiated (by way of differences) into species. Any species, beneath its given genus, is fully a member of that genus, but the difference that has so distinguished it, is not. Let us take an example: the genus animal. In this case, the difference, we might say, is rational, by which the genus animal is speciated into the species of man and beast, for Aristotle. Both man and beast are equally members of the genus animal, but rational, the differentia whereby they are separated, is not. Differentiae cannot belong, properly, to the given genus of which they are differentiae, and yet, differences exist, that is, they have being. Therefore, if differences have being, and the differentiae of any given genus cannot belong, properly speaking, to that genus, it follows that being cannot be a genus.

Metaphysics therefore cannot be the science of being as such, (because, given that there is no genus, ‘being,’ there is no being as such), but rather, of being qua being, or, put otherwise, the science that focuses on beings insofar as they are said to be. The metaphysician, Aristotle holds, must study being by way of abstraction—all that is is said to be in virtue of something common, and this commonality, Aristotle holds, is rooted in a thing’s being a substance, or a bearer of properties. The primary and common way in which a thing is said to be, Aristotle argues, is that it is a substance, a bearer of properties. Properties are, no doubt, but they are only to the extent that there is a substance there to bear them. There is no ‘red’ as such; there are only red things. Metaphysics, therefore, is the science that studies primarily the nature of what it means to be a substance, and what it means to be an attribute of a substance, but insofar as it relates to a substance. All of these other qualities, and along with them, the Aristotelian categories, are related analogically, through substances, to being. This explains Aristotle’s famous dictum: Being is said in many ways. (Metaphysics, IV.2) This is Aristotle’s doctrine known as the equivocity of being. Being is hierarchical in that there are greater and lesser degrees to which a thing may be said to be. In this sense, analogical being is a natural bedfellow with the theological impetus, in that it provides a means of speaking and thinking about God that does not flirt with heresy, that falls into neither of the two following traps: (1) Believing that a finite mind could ever possess knowledge of an infinite being; (2) Thinking that God’s qualities, for instance, his love or his mercy, are to be understood in like fashion to our own. Analogical being easily and naturally allows the Scholastic tradition to hierarchize the scala naturae, the great chain of being, thus creating a space in language and in thought for the ineffable.

Deleuze, however, will argue that the Aristotelian equivocity disallows ontology a genuine concept of Being, of the individual, or of difference itself: “However, this form of distribution commanded by the categories seemed to us to betray the nature of Being (as a cardinal and collective concept) and the nature of the distributions themselves (as nomadic rather than sedentary and fixed distributions), as well as the nature of difference (as individuating difference).” (Difference and Repetition, 269) By ‘cardinal’ and ‘collective,’ respectively, Deleuze means Being as the fundamental nature of what-is, (which is the individuating power of differentiation) and being as the whole of what-is. Analogical being, Deleuze objects, cannot think being as such (because being is not a genus, for Aristotle), and then, because it posits substances and categories (fixed, rather than fluid, models of distribution of being), it misses the nature of difference itself (because difference is always ‘filtered’ through a higher concept of identity), as well as the ability to think the individual (because thought can only go as far ‘down’ as the substance, which is always comprehended through our concepts). Thus, ontology, understood analogically, cannot do what it is designed to do: to think being.

To think a genuine concept of difference (and hence, being) requires an ontology which abandons the analogical model of being and affirms the univocity of being, that being is said in only one sense of everything of which it is said. Here, Deleuze cites three key figures that have made such a transformation in thinking possible: John Duns Scotus, Benedict de Spinoza, and Friedrich Nietzsche.

Deleuze calls Duns Scotus’ book, the Opus Oxoniense, “the greatest book of pure ontology.” (Difference and Repetition, 39) Scotus argues against Thomas Aquinas, and hence, against the Aristotelian doctrine of equivocity, in an effort to salvage the reliability of proofs for God’s existence, rooted, as they must be, in the experiences and the minds of human beings. Any argument that draws a conclusion about the being of God on the basis of some fact about his creatures presupposes, Scotus thinks, the univocal expression of the term, ‘being.’ If the being of God is wholly other, or even, analogous to, the being of man, then the relation of the given premises to the conclusion, “God exists,” thereby loses all validity. While, as noted, understanding being analogically affords the theological tradition a handy way of keeping the creation distinct from its creator, this same distance, Scotus thinks, also keeps us from truly possessing natural knowledge about God. So in order to save that knowledge, Scotus had to abolish the analogical understanding of being. However, Deleuze notes, in order to keep from falling into a heresy of another sort (namely, pantheism, the conviction that everything is God), Scotus had to neutralize univocal being. The abstract concept of being precedes the division into the categories of “finite” and “infinite,” so that, even if being is univocal, God’s being is nevertheless distinguished from man’s by way of God’s infinity. Being is therefore, univocal, but neutral and abstract, not affirmed.

Spinoza offers the next step in the affirmation of univocal being. Spinoza creates an elaborate ontology of expression and immanent causality, consisting of substance, attributes, and modes. There is but one substance, God or Nature, which is eternal, self-caused, necessary, and absolutely infinite. A given attribute is conceived through itself and is understood as constituting the essence of a substance, while a mode is an affection of a substance, a way a substance is. God is absolutely free because there is nothing outside of Nature which could determine God to act in such and such a way, so God expresses himself in his creation from the necessity of his own Nature. God’s nature is his power, and his power is his virtue. It is sometimes said that Spinoza’s God is not the theist’s God, and this is no doubt true, but it is equally true that Spinoza’s Nature is not the naturalist’s nature, because Spinoza equates Nature and God; in other words, he makes the world of Nature an object of worshipful admiration, or affirmation. Thus Spinoza takes the step that Scotus could not; nevertheless, Spinoza does not quite complete the transformation to the univocity of being. Spinoza leaves intact the priority of the substance over its modes. Modes can be thought only through substance, but the converse is not true. Thus for the great step Spinoza takes towards the immanentizing of philosophy, he leaves a tiny bit of transcendence untouched. Deleuze writes, “substance must itself be said of the modes and only of the modes.” (Difference and Repetition, 40)

This shift is made, Deleuze claims, with Nietzsche’s notion of eternal return. Deleuze understands Nietzsche’s eternal return in the terms of what Deleuze calls the disjunctive synthesis. In the disjunctive synthesis, we find the in itself of Deleuze’s notion of difference in itself. The eternal return, or the constant returning of the same as the different, constitutes systems, but these systems are, as we saw above, nomadic and fluid, constituted on the basis of disjunctive syntheses, which is itself a differential communication between two or more divergent series.

Given in experience, Deleuze claims, is diversity—not difference as such, but differences, different things, limits, oppositions, and so forth. But this experience of diversity presupposes, Deleuze claims, “a swarm of differences, a pluralism of free, wild, untamed differences; a properly differential and original space and time.” (Difference and Repetition, 50) In other words, the perceived, planar effects of limitations and oppositions presuppose a pure depth or a sub-phenomenal play of constitutive difference. Insofar as they are the conditions of space and time as we sense them, this depth that he is looking for is itself an imperceptible spatio-temporality. This depth (or ‘pure spatium’), he claims, is where difference, singularities, series, and systems, relate and interact. It is necessary, Deleuze claims, because the developmental and differential processes whereby living systems are constituted take place so rapidly and violently that they would tear apart a fully-formed being. Deleuze, comparing the world to an egg, argues that there are “systematic vital movements, torsions and drifts, that only the embryo can sustain: an adult would be torn apart by them.” (Difference and Repetition, 118)

At the embryonic level are series, with each series being defined by the differences between its terms, rather than its terms themselves. Rather, we should say that its terms are themselves differences, or what Deleuze calls intensities: “Intensities are implicated multiplicities, ‘implexes,’ made up of relations between asymmetrical elements.” (Difference and Repetition, 244). An intensity is essentially an energy, but an energy is always a difference or an imbalance, folded in on itself, an essentially elemental asymmetry. These intensities are the terms of a given series. The terms, however, are themselves related to other terms, and through these relations, these intensities are continuously modified. An intensity is an embryonic quantity in that its own internal resonance, which is constitutive of higher levels of synthesis and actualization, pulsates in a pure speed and time that would devastate a constituted being; it is for this reason that qualities and surface phenomena can only come to be on a plane in which difference as such is cancelled or aborted. In explicating its implicated differences, the system, so constituted, cancels out those differences, even if the differential ground rumbles beneath.

A system is formed whenever two or more of these heterogeneous series communicate. Insofar as each series is itself constituted by differences, the communication that takes place between the two heterogeneous series is a difference relating differences, a second-order difference, which Deleuze calls the differenciator, in that these differences relate, and in so relating, they differenciate first-order differences. This relation takes place through what Deleuze calls the dark precursor, comparing it to the negative path cleared for a bolt of lightning. Once this communication is established, the system explodes: “coupling between heterogeneous systems, from which is derived an internal resonance within the system, and from which in turn is derived a forced movement the amplitude of which exceeds that of the basic series themselves.” (Difference and Repetition, 117) The constitution of a series thus results in what we referred to above as the explication of qualities, which are themselves the results of a cancelled difference. Thus, Deleuze claims, the compounding or synthesis of these systems, series, and relations are the introduction of spatio-temporal dynamisms, which are themselves the sources of qualities and extensions.

The whole of being, ultimately, is a system, connected by way of these differential relations—difference relating to difference through difference—the very nature of Deleuze’s disjunctive synthesis. Difference in itself teems with vitality and life. As systems differentiate, their differences ramify throughout the system, and in so doing, series form new series, and new systems, de-enlisting and redistributing the singular points of interest and their constitutive and corresponding nomadic relations, which are themselves implicating, and, conversely, explicated in the phenomenal realm. The disjunctive synthesis is the affirmative employment of the creativity brought about by the various plays of differences. Against Leibniz’s notion of compossibility is opposed the affirmation of incompossibility. Leibniz defined the perfection of the cosmos in terms of its compossibility, and this in terms of a maximization of continuity. The disjunctive synthesis brings about the communication and cooperative disharmony of divergent and heterogeneous series; it does not, thereby, cancel the differences between them. Where incompossibility for Leibniz was a means of exclusion—an infinity of possible worlds excluded from reality on the basis of their incompossibility, in the hands of Deleuze, it becomes a means of opening the thing to the possible infinity of events. It is in this sense that Nietzsche’s eternal return is, for Deleuze, the affirmation of the return of the different, and hence, the affirmation, all of chance, all at once.

Finally, the eternal return is the name that Deleuze gives to the pulsating-contracting temporality according to which the pure spatium or depth differenciates. In Chapter 2 of Difference and Repetition, Deleuze employs the Husserlian discussion of the living present. However, unlike Derrida, Deleuze will simply discard Husserl’s notion of the primal impression—this term never makes an appearance in Difference and Repetition. Deleuze will argue that, with respect to time, the present is all there is, but the present itself is nothing more than the relation of retention to protention. If the present were truly present, (in the sense of a self-contained kernel of time, like Husserl’s primal impression), then, just as Aristotle noted, the present could never pass, because in order to pass, it would have to pass within another moment. The present can only pass, Deleuze claims, because the past is already in the present, reaching through the present, into the future, drawing the future into itself. Time, in other words, is nothing more than the contraction of past and future. The present, therefore, is the beating heart of difference in itself, but it is a present constituted on the basis of a differentiation.

Deleuze is therefore a differential ontologist in that he attempts to formulate a notion of difference that is: (1) The constitutive play of forces underlying the constitution of identities; (2) Purely relational, that is, non-negational, and hence, not in any way subordinate to the principle of identity. It is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of identity but in such a way as to not recreate the presuppositions surrounding identity at the level of the conditions themselves—it is an ontology that attempts to think the conditions of real experience, the world as it is lived.

4. Conclusion

To briefly sum up, we can say that Derrida and Deleuze are the two key differential ontologists in the history of philosophy. While others before them were indeed thinkers of multiplicity, as opposed to thinkers of identity, none, so rigorously as Derrida and Deleuze, came to the conclusion that what was required in order to truly think multiplicity was an explicit formulation of a concept of difference, in itself. One of the key distinctions between the two of them, which explains many of their other differences, is their respective attitudes towards fidelity to the tradition of philosophy. While Derrida will understand fidelity to the tradition in the sense of embracing the presuppositions and prejudices of the tradition, using them, ultimately, to think beyond the tradition, but in such a way as to speak constantly of the end of metaphysics, and ultimately eschewing the adoption of any traditional philosophical terms such as ontology, being, and so forth; Deleuze, on the contrary, will understand fidelity to the philosophical tradition in the sense of embracing what philosophy has always sought to do, to think the fundamental, and will, in the name of this task, happily discard any presuppositions or prejudices that the tradition has attempted to bestow. So, while Derrida will, for instance, claim that the founding privilege of presence is not up for grabs in philosophy, but will, at the same time, avoid using terms like experience, being, ontology, concept, and so forth, Deleuze will claim that it is precisely the emphasis on presence (in the form of representational concepts and categories) that has kept philosophy from living up to its task. Therefore, the prejudice should be discarded. But that does not mean, Deleuze will argue, that we should give up metaphysics. If the old metaphysics no longer works, throw it out, and build a new one, from the ground up, if need be, but a new metaphysics, all the same.

5. References and Further Reading

The following is an annotated list of the key sources in which the differential ontologies of Derrida and Deleuze are formulated.

a. Primary Sources

  • Deleuze, Gilles. Bergsonism. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. New York: Zone Books, 1988.
    • Henri Bergson was a French “celebrity” philosopher in the early twentieth century, whose philosophy had very much fallen out of favor in France by the mid to late 1920s, as Husserlian phenomenology began to work its way into Paris. Deleuze’s 1966 text on Bergson played no small part in bringing Bergson back into fashion. In this text, Deleuze analyzes the Bergsonian notions of durée, memory, and élan vital, demonstrating the consistent trajectory of Bergson’s work from beginning to end, and highlighting the centrality of Bergson’s notion of time for the entirety of Deleuze’s thought.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Desert Islands and Other Texts (1953-1974). Ed. David Lapoujade, Trans. Michael Taormina. Los Angeles and New York: Semiotext(e), 2004.
    • This text contains many of Deleuze’s most important essays from his philosophically “formative” years. It contains his 1954 review of Jean Hyppolite’s Logic and Existence, as well as very early essays on Bergson. In addition, it contains interviews and round-table discussions surrounding the period leading up to and following the 1968 release of Difference and Repetition.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Difference and Repetition. Translated by Paul Patton. New York: Columbia University Press, 1994.
    • This is without question the most important book Deleuze ever wrote. It was his principal thesis for the Doctorat D’Etat in 1968, and it is in this text that the various elements that had emerged from his book-length engagements with other philosophers over the years come together into the critique of representation and the formulation of a differential ontology.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Expressionism in Philosophy: Spinoza. Translated by Martin Joughin. New York: Zone Books, 1992.
    • This book was his secondary, historical thesis in 1968, though there is good evidence that the book was actually first drafted in 1961-62, around the same time as the book on Nietzsche. The concept of expression, here analyzed in Spinoza, plays a very important role for Deleuze, and it is Spinoza who provides an alternative ontology of immanence which, contrary to that of Hegel, (quite prominent in mid-1960s France), does not rely upon the movement of negation, a concept that, for Deleuze, does not belong in the domain of ontology. As we saw in the article, Being is itself creative, and hence an object of affirmation, and to make negation an integral element in one’s ontology is, for Deleuze, antithetical to affirmation. Deleuze emphasizes expression, rather than negation. This emphasis already plays a role in the 1954 Review of Hyppolite (mentioned above).
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Kant’s Critical Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Barbara Habberjam. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984.
    • In this 1963 text, Deleuze looks at the philosophy of Immanuel Kant, through the lens of the third CritiqueThe Critique of Judgment, arguing that Kant, (thanks in large part to Salomon Maimon) recognized the problems in the first two Critiques, and began attempting to correct them at the end of his life. In this text Deleuze examines Kant’s notion of the faculties, highlighting that by the time of the third Critique, (and unlike its two predecessors), the faculties are in a discordant accord—none legislating over the others.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. The Logic of Sense. Translated by Mark Lester with Charles Stivale. Edited by Constantin V. Boundas. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1990.
    • This text is interesting for a number of reasons. First, published in 1969, just one year following Difference and Repetition, it explores many of the same themes of Difference and Repetition, such as becomingtimeeternal returnsingularities, and so forth. At the same time, other themes, such as the event become centrally important, and these themes are now explored through the notion of sense. In a way it is in part a reorientation of Difference and Repetition. But one of the most important points to note is that the notion of the fractal subject is brought into conversation with psychoanalytic theory, and thus, this text forms a bridge between Deleuze’s earlier philosophical works and his political works with Félix Guattari, the first of which, Anti-Oedipus, was released just three years later, in 1972. In addition, the appendices in this volume include important essays on the reversal of Platonism, on the Stoics, and on Pierre Klossowski.
  • Deleuze, Gilles. Nietzsche and Philosophy. Translated by Hugh Tomlinson. New York: ColumbiaUniversity Press, 1983.
    • This book, from 1962, was Deleuze’s second book. It may be a stretch to say that this book is the second most important book in Deleuze’s corpus. Nevertheless, it is certainly high on the list of importance. Here we see in their formational expressions, some of the motifs that will dominate all of Deleuze’s works up through The Logic of Sense. Among them are the rejection of negation, the articulation of the eternal return, the incompleteness of the Kantian critique, the purely relational ontology of force, which is the will to power, and so forth. This book lays out in very raw and accessible, (if somewhat underdeveloped) form some of the most significant criticisms later developed in Difference and Repetition.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Dissemination. Translated by Barbara Johnson. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This text was published in 1972, (along with Positions and Margins of Philosophy) as part of Derrida’s second publication blitz, (the first being in 1967). In addition to the titular essay, it contains the very important essay on Plato, “Plato’s Pharmacy.” Like much of what Derrida wrote, this text is extremely difficult, and probably not a good starter text for Derrida. Nonetheless, it’s one of his more important books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Edmund Husserl’s Origin of Geometry: An Introduction. Lincoln, Nebraska: University of Nebraska Press, 1989.
    • In 1962, Derrida translated an essay from very late in Husserl’s career, “The Origin of Geometry.” He also wrote a translator’s introduction to the essay—Husserl’s essay is about 18 pages long, while Derrida’s introduction is about 150 pages in length. This essay is of particular interest because it deals with the problem of how the ideal is constituted in the sphere of the subject; this will be a problem that will occupy Derrida up through the period of Voice and Phenomenon and beyond.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Margins of Philosophy. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1982.
    • This book is a collection of essays from the late-1960s up through the early 1970s, and is another from the 1972 publication blitz. It is very important for numerous reasons, but in no small part because it is here that his engagement with the work of Martin Heidegger, (which will occupy him throughout the remainder of his career), robustly begins. It contains some of the most important essays from Derrida’s mature work. Among them are the famous “Différance” essay, “The Ends of Man,” “Ousia and Grammē: Note on a Note from Being and Time,” “White Mythology,” (on the essential metaphoricity of language), and “Signature Event Context,” known for spawning the famous debate with John Searle over the work of J.L. Austin.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Of Grammatology. Translated by Gayatri Chakravorty Spivak. Baltimore and London: The JohnsHopkinsUniversity Press, 1974.
    • This book is one from the 1967 publication blitz, and is probably Derrida’s most famous work, among philosophers and non-philosophers alike. In addition, it is really one of the only book-length pieces Derrida wrote that is (at least the first part), merely programmatic and expository, as opposed to the prolonged engagements he typically undertakes with a particular text or thinker (the second part of the book is such an engagement, primarily with the thought of Jean-Jacques Rousseau). In this book we get extended discussions of the history of metaphysics, logocentrism, the privilege of voice over writing in the tradition, différance, trace, and supplementarity. It is also in this text that the infamous quote, “There is no outside-text,” is found.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Positions. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1981.
    • This book is from the 1972 group, and is a very short collection of interviews. It is highly recommended as a good starting-point for those approaching Derrida for the first time. Here Derrida lays out in very straightforward, programmatic terms, the stakes of the deconstructive project, unencumbered by deep textual analysis.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Voice and Phenomenon. Trans. Leonard Lawlor. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2011.
    • This is probably the single most important book that Derrida wrote. It is, like most of the rest of his work, a textual engagement with Husserl. Nevertheless, Derrida concentrates on a few key passages of Husserl’s works, most of which are cited in the body of Derrida’s work, such that a very basic knowledge of the Husserlian project makes reading Derrida’s text quite possible. It is in his engagement with Husserl, and the deconstruction of consciousness, that Derrida formulates the key concepts of différancetrace, and supplementarity, that will govern the direction of his work for most of the rest of his career. Derrida himself claims (in Positions) that this is his favorite of his books.
  • Derrida, Jacques. Writing and Difference. Translated by Alan Bass. Chicago: The University of Chicago Press, 1978.
    • This book is from the 1967 publication blitz, and it is a collection of Derrida’s early essays up through the mid-1960s. Here we get a very important essay on Michel Foucault that spawned the bitter fallout between the two for many years, the essay on Emmanuel Levinas that reoriented Levinas’ thinking, as well as demonstrated the broad and deep knowledge that Derrida had of the phenomenological tradition. In addition, this essay, “Violence and Metaphysics,” highlights the important role that Levinas will play in Derrida’s own thinking. There is also a very important essay on Freud and the trace, which is contemporaneous with the writing of Voice and Phenomenon.

b. Secondary Sources

There are many terrific volumes of secondary material on these two thinkers, but here are selected a few of the most relevant with respect to the themes explored in this article.

  • Bell, Jeffrey A. Philosophy at the Edge of Chaos. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 2006.
  • Bell, Jeffrey A. The Problem of Difference: Phenomenology and Poststructuralism. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1998.
    • Both of Bell’s books deal with the question of difference, and situate, primarily Deleuze but Derrida as well, within the larger context of the history of philosophical attempts to think about difference, including Plato, Aristotle, Whitehead, Descartes, and Kant.
  • Bogue, Ronald. Deleuze and Guattari. London and New York: Routledge, 1989.
    • Bogue’s text was one of the earlier attempts to write a comprehensive introductory text that took into account Deleuze’s historical engagements, along with his own philosophical articulations of his concepts, and the later political and aesthetic texts as well. This text is still a ‘standard’.
  • Bryant, Levi. Difference and Givenness: Deleuze’s Transcendental Empiricism and the Ontology of Immanence. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 2008.
    • Bryant’s is one of the best books on Deleuze in recent years. It focuses primarily on Difference and Repetition, but examines the concept of transcendental empiricism, what it means to attempt to think the conditions of real experience, through the lens of Deleuze’s previous interactions with the thinkers who informed the research of Difference and Repetition.
  • De Beistigui, Miguel. Truth and Genesis: Philosophy as Differential Ontology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2004.
    • De Beistigui, whose early works centered on the philosophy of Martin Heidegger, argues in this book that Deleuze completes the Heideggerian attempt to think difference, in that it is Deleuze who overcomes the humanism that Heidegger never quite escapes.
  • Descombes, Vincent. Modern French Philosophy. Trans. L. Scott-Fox and J.M. Harding. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1980.
    • Descombes’ book was one of the first to attempt to capture the heart of French philosophy in the wake of Bergson. It is still one of the best, especially given its brevity. Chapters 5 and 6 are particularly relevant.
  • Gasché, Rodolphe. The Tain of the Mirror: Derrida and the Philosophy of Reflection. Cambridge and London: HarvardUniversity Press, 1986.
    • Gasché’s text was one of the earliest and most forceful attempts to situate Derrida’s thinking in the context of an explicit philosophical problem, the problem of critical reflection, complete with a long philosophical history. In the Anglophone world, Derrida’s work was at this time explored mostly in the context of Literary Theory departments. While that gave Derrida something of a ‘head start’ over the reception of Deleuze in the United States, it also created the unfortunate impression, throughout academic philosophy, that Derrida’s project was one of merely ‘playing’ with canonical texts. Gasché’s book corrected that misconception, and to this day it remains one of the best texts for understanding the overall thrust of Derrida’s project.
  • Hägglund, Martin. Radical Atheism: Derrida and the Time of Life. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2008.
    • Hägglund’s book enters into the oft-discussed theme of Derrida’s so-called religious turn in his later period. It is one of the best recent books on Derrida’s thinking, taking up the implications of a fully immanent analysis of temporality.
  • Hughes, Joe. Deleuze and the Genesis of Representation. London: Continuum International Publishing Group, 2008.
    • This book is one of the first to take up a close comparison of Deleuze with the philosophy of Husserl, boldly arguing that Deleuze’s project is marked from start to finish with a certain phenomenological impetus.
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Derrida and Husserl: The Basic Problem of Phenomenology. Bloomington and Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2002.
    • Lawlor was one of the first American scholars to emphasize the centrality of Husserl to Derrida’s work. This book is particularly helpful because, inasmuch as it deals with the entirety of Derrida’s engagement with Husserl (from 1953 up through Voice and Phenomenon and beyond), it provides a rigorous but accessible explication of the early formation of Derrida’s project. It is without question one of the best books on Derrida available.
  • Marrati, Paola. Genesis and Trace: Derrida Reading Husserl and Heidegger. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2005.
    • This book, first published in French in 1998, explores the origins of the deconstructive project in Derrida’s engagement with the phenomenological tradition, and more specifically, with the question of time. It demonstrates and articulates the lasting significance of the Husserlian problematic up through Derrida’s immersion into Heidegger’s thought, and beyond.
  • Smith, Daniel W. Essays on Deleuze. Edinburgh: EdinburghUniversity Press, 2012.
    • Smith has for years been one of the leading voices in the world when it comes to Deleuze, and this 2012 volume at last collects all of his most important essays on Deleuze, along with a few new ones. Of particular interest is the essay on the simulacrum, the one on univocity, the one on the conditions of the new, and the comparative essay on Deleuze and Derrida.

c. Other Sources Cited in this Article

  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 1. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Aristotle. Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, Vol. 2. Ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Duns Scotus. Philosophical Writings—A Selection. Trans. Allan B. Wolter. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1987.
  • Heraclitus. Fragments: A Text and Translation with a Commentary By T.M. Robinson. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1987.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology: An Introduction to Phenomenological Philosophy. Trans. David Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy, First Book. Trans. F. Kersten. Dordrecht, Boston, and London: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1998.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Logical Investigations Volume I. Ed. Dermot Moran. Trans. J.N. Findlay. New York: Routledge, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1893-1917). Trans. John Barnett Brough. Dordrecht, Boston, and London: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1991.
  • Hyppolite, Jean. Logic and Existence. Trans. Leonard Lawlor and Amit Sen. Albany: State University of New York Press, 1997.
  • Parmenides. Fragments: A Text and Translation with an Introduction By David Gallop. Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1984.
  • Plato. Complete Works. Ed. John M. Cooper. Associate Ed. D.S. Hutchinson. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1997.
  • Spinoza. Complete Works. Ed. Michael L. Morgan. Trans. Samuel Shirley. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 2002.


Author Information

Vernon W. Cisney
Gettysburg College
U. S. A.

Modal Metaphysics

Modal metaphysics concerns the metaphysical underpinning of our modal statements. These are statements about what is possible or what is necessarily so. We can construe the primary question of modal metaphysics as, “When we make a statement about what is possible or necessary, what determines the truth or falsity of the statement?” As an illustration, consider the statement “It is possible for me to be a dentist.” This says that one possibility for me is to enter the dentistry profession. That seems true enough. But if so, what determines its truth? Normally, a statement is true because it represents a situation that actually obtains, but in the present case, the statement represents a situation which does not actually obtain. So, why is the statement true?

Some philosophers, such as W.V.O Quine, dismiss this question by rejecting the coherence of modal notions. More typically, though, metaphysicians will answer that modal statements are not evaluated by how things actually are, but rather by how things might be or must be. Following Saul Kripke (1959; 1963), modal facts are construed as facts about possible worlds, where the actual world is just one among the many worlds that are possible. Kripke’s modal logic first defines each possible world by a maximally consistent set of statements, a consistent set such that for any statement p, either p or ~p is a member. Once these worlds are defined, a statement with the normal form “Possibly, p” is said  [in the most elementary kind of Kripkean logic]  to be true if, and only if, there is at least one possible world in which the state-of-affairs p obtains. Similarly, “Necessarily, p” is true precisely when p obtains in every possible world. So, the sentence “It is possible for me to become a dentist” is true because there is at least one possible world, so defined, where I am a dentist. Note that the above concerns metaphysical possibilities, specifically. The article will not discuss epistemic possibilities.

The  Kripkean apparatus was a great advance in logic, but it did not resolve the distinctly metaphysical issue. If our question was roughly, “What determines the truth or falsity of modal statements?,” then Kripke’s logic just seems to replace this question with “What are these ‘possible worlds’ that determine their truth or falsity?” Yet due to the influence of Kripke’s system, the latter question is often the one pursued in the literature and not the former question. So, this article reviews five kinds of answer to the question about possible worlds: (1) Meinong's Realism, (2) David Lewis’ Realism, (3) Ersatzism, (4) Fictionalism, and (5) David Armstrong’s hybrid of (3) and (4). The last section considers Quine’s skepticism about the issue and about modality in general.

Table of Contents

  1. Meinong's Realism
  2. Lewis’ Realism
  3. Ersatzism
    1. Sententialism
    2. Propositionalism and Property Ersatzism
    3. Pictorial Ersatzism
    4. Combinatorialism
    5. Non-Reductivism
  4. Fictionalism
  5. Armstrong’s Hybrid
  6. Quine's Skepticism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Meinong's Realism

Meinong's Realism, also called Meinongian Realism, is the contemporary Meinongian view which starts with Kripke’s possible worlds and attempts to make metaphysical sense of non-actual worlds and their denizens. The label ‘Meinongian,’ however, is anachronistic since Alexius Meinong was writing years before the advent of Kripkean worlds. Yet Meinong’s view of non-actual objects is one position to take regarding non-actual worlds. And indeed, the most important figure in modal metaphysics—David Lewis—was initially construed as a Meinongian about these worlds (see, for example, Plantinga 1976, Lycan 1979). Though Lewis’ (1986) view is clearly not a Meinongian one, as we shall see in the next section.

According to the Meinongian, it is intuitively evident that there are non-existent objects, such as Pegasus, unicorns, and the like. Even impossible objects, such as round squares, are counted among the things that there are. Infamously, Meinong once expressed this in the slogan “there are objects such that it is true to say of them that there are no such objects” (1904, p. 83). Despite the air of paradox, however, the idea that non-existent objects somehow “exist” can claim several advantages. For one, it is eminently faithful to ordinary language use, where apparently speakers refer freely to non-existents. For another, the view naturally extends the commonsense semantics of ordinary names to empty names such as ‘Pegasus.’ Unlike the descriptivist, say, the Meinongian simply regards ‘Pegasus’ labeling an object (albeit a non-existing one), just in the way that people commonly regard ‘Tony Blair’ as a label for a person. And besides this straightforward linguistic account, the Meinongian view also delivers objects to thoughts which might otherwise seem void. Thus, the Meinongian can say (for example) that physicists who hypothesized Vulcan were not literally thinking of no object; rather, they were thinking of a bona fide object, albeit a non-existent one.

Yet the reader may already sense one urgent objection for Meinongianism, namely, that it just dresses up something contradictory. On this line, once all the obfuscation is cleared away, Meinong is committed to the absurdity that non-existents exist. Meinong, however, anticipated this reaction and suggested that his intent was not to place non-existent objects in the categories of both being and non-being. Rather, they are to be placed in neither category, and instead lie “beyond being and non-being” (op. cit., p. 86).

Alternatively, some Meinongians respond to the charge by distinguishing two kinds of being, that is to say, the usual kind of being, and the sort of the “being” that Pegasus has (with scare quotes). This would allow us to reconstrue Meinong’s slogan as the claim that “there are” objects of which it is true to say that there are no such objects. However, these Meinongians often do not provide much explication of “being” in the scare-quoted sense, and critics have thus doubted its intelligibility.

Relatedly, there is Russell’s objection that Meinong’s commitment to the existence of round squares lands in contradiction.  In “On Denoting,” Russell generally objects to Meinong’s lack of a “robust sense of reality;” however, Russell regards  impossibilia (that is, objects which are neither actual nor possible) as especially problematic. Nonetheless, our concern here is with possibilia only, and Meinong’s view of impossibilia can be bracketted,

Regardless, even if the Meinongian view is intelligible, it faces additional difficulties. For instance, it appears Occam’s Razor would have us shave off Meinongian objects from our ontology (Quine 1948). A second concern is that some Meinongian objects seem incomplete or gappy. For instance, does Sherlock Holmes have a mole on his left knee? Even though “there is” such a person, Meinongianism apparently does not determine a fact of the matter. (Though again, a Meinongian view of possibilia, specifically, might just reject incomplete objects.) Quine protested that Meinongian objects have no clear individuation-conditions. Imagine first a non-existent bald man in a doorway, and then imagine a non-existent fat man in the doorway. Now ask yourself: Have you imagined the same man or not? The Meinongian seems to lack the resources to determine a fact of the matter.

2. Lewis’ Realism

The Meinongian view could be seen as Realist view about possible objects, since it holds that all possible objects (possibilia) are “real” in an important sense. A more robust kind of Realism, however, is expounded by David Lewis (1969; 1973; 1986). Unlike Meinongians who identify different kinds of “being” (or a realm “beyond being and non-being”), Lewis makes clear that there is only one kind of being, and that all possibilia (that is, all actual and non-actual possible objects) have it. Thus Lewis’ provocatively suggests that non-actual possibles exist in just the same way that you and I do (1986, pp. 2-3) Despite the prima facie implausibility, however, there is a type of indispensability argument which may speak in favor of the view. The idea is that talk of “possible worlds” is too useful to modal semantics to see it as a mere façon de parler (way of speaking). In the hard sciences, moreover, if an unobservable entity is theoretically useful, that is often seen as a reason to think it exists. In like manner, says Lewis, the theoretical utility of possible worlds provides at least some reason to believe that these objects exist (in the only sense of ‘exist’ that there is).

Now even if we are inclined to posit possibilia, it may seem that Lewis goes too far in declaring that possible worlds exist “in just the same way” that you and I do. After all, you and I are actual whereas Pegasus and his world are not. However, it is crucial that when Lewis calls a possible object “actual,” he is not attributing it any ontological status beyond the fact that it exists. For when Lewis says we are “actual” (and Pegasus is not), he only means that we are actual relative to this world. In contrast, relative to a world of Greek mythology, he will say it is Pegasus who is actual and we who are not. This should not suggest that there is a special property of “actuality” that is being passed around. Rather, it illustrates that Lewis uses ‘actual’ as an indexical term vis-à-vis worlds: Just as the pronoun ‘I’ picks out different people on different occasions (depending on the speaker), ‘actual’ can denote the objects of different worlds, depending on which world is relevant. Accordingly, Lewis’ use of ‘actual’ only serves to locate an object in the world of concern, among the myriad of worlds that exist. But consequently, there is no non-relative sense in which we (but not Pegasus) are “actual.”

So again, anything possible exists (in the only sense of ‘exists’ that there is); nonetheless, some objects are also actual though this merely serves to locate them in a contextually relevant world. But this talk of “locating” should not suggest that possible worlds exist in a shared space, where each world has a “location” in that space. For Lewis denies that spatio-temporal relations hold between worlds. Worlds are spatio-temporally isolated on his view; we cannot speak of events occurring at the same time in different worlds, nor can we speak of distances between worlds. As a corollary, there cannot be causal relations between worlds either (assuming causes bear some temporal relation to their effects). So oddly, even though alternate worlds exist just as much as we do, they do not exist anywhere in relation to us.

This could mislead, however, in suggesting that Lewisian worlds are a type of abstract object, akin to universals or sets. Realists about abstracta sometimes say that their objects lack a location, despite the fact they exist. However, Lewis concedes at least three senses in which his worlds qualify as “concrete.” First, note that if sets and universals are counted as abstract, then a contrast can be with individuals or particulars. In that case, Lewisian worlds qualify as non-abstract or “concrete,” since they are particulars. (But, note that a concrete world can be home to abstract objects all the same.) Second, the abstract/concrete distinction sometimes concerns whether an object has spatio-temporal dimensions. Yet here too, since Lewis’ worlds are spatio-temporal kinds of entities, they qualify as “concrete.” Finally, Lewis recognizes that some things might be abstract in the sense of being an “abstraction,” that is, they might be the kind of entity represented by an incomplete or gappy description. (An example would be “the Average American”). In line with Kripke, however, Lewis accepts that each possible world is described by the sentences in some maximally consistent set—and the set would describe the world completely. So worlds are concrete by this criterion also.

However, in talking of maximally consistent sets, Lewis would seem to utilize the modal notion of “consistency.” Note that consistency is indeed modal; a set of sentences is consistent if and only if it is possible for those sentences to be jointly true. So at first, it may seem that Lewis’ theory simply helps itself to one of the modal notions it was supposed to account for. But this is misleading. Although Lewis accepts Kripke’s way of characterizing worlds, it is ultimately unnecessary to his metaphysics. Since Lewis’ worlds genuinely exist, he can say instead that worlds are non-gappy by simply appealing to the non-gappy facts of such worlds.

Not only is each world “gapless,” he also thinks there is no gap in the collective of worlds. That is to say, absolutely every way that a world could possibly be is the way that some world is. But oddly, this last statement looks truistic given Lewis’ Realism. For if robust facts about worlds determine what is possible, then trivially the worlds exhaust the possibilities—even if there are only 17 worlds or 1 (or even none)! To secure the “plentitude” of worlds, then, Lewis makes use of a certain Recombination Principle. In its most basic form, this principle states that any object can co-exist with any other object. However, Lewis eventually revises this in considering two objects from different worlds. Objects from different worlds cannot co-exist, since Lewis presumes that worlds cannot “overlap” in any way. So in the end, Lewis achieves the plentitude of worlds with a modified Recombination Principle; this says that if x ¹ y, then in some possible world, x or a duplicate of x co-exists with y or a duplicate of y (assuming the spacetime of some world is large enough to contain the two).

Lewis’ “no overlap” intuition brings us to an important feature of his modal metaphysics. Consider that, according to this intuition, you are part of the actual world and only the actual world. There is no sense in which you inhabit some genuinely existing alternative universe. Nonetheless, if we follow Kripke’s logic to the letter, the statement “It is possible for me to be a dentist” is true (if uttered by you), in virtue of some alternate world where you yourself exist and are a dentist. Occupying more than one world may be fine as concerns pure logic, but when taken as a metaphysical thesis, Lewis finds it intolerable. So in the end, he denies that in alternate worlds, you make true the modal statements about you.

But if not you, who else could do this job? Lewis (1973) responds with the idea of a counterpart: Even though you only occupy the actual world, you have counterparts in other possible worlds that determine the truth of ‘It is possible for me to be a dentist.' In general, a counterpart will be a non-actual object that is “sufficiently similar” to you in certain worlds. But when is an object “sufficiently similar?”  Lewis in fact thinks there are no absolute conditions on this. In some contexts ‘It is possible for me to be a dentist’ (uttered by you) is true in virtue of a non-actual dentist that, say, merely looks like you. Whereas in other contexts, perhaps the only thing that will do is a dentist who is a strict molecule-for-molecule duplicate of you.

Counterpart theory, even independent of Lewisian Realism, has several objections to reckon with. For instance, simply as a logical point, it has the strange consequence that “Necessarily, I am myself” is true only in virtue of objects that are neither identical to me nor to one another. (Technical aside: Lewis thinks there is nothing strange here if we think of a counterpart as a “deferred referent.”) Regardless, let us now turn to criticisms of Lewis’ Realism itself.

As Lewis is aware, the most glaring issue is that the view just ignores the Principle of Parsimony, which demands that entities should not be multiplied beyond necessity. According to this objection, the uncountable worlds that Lewis’ posits are just ontologically gratuitous, akin to Ptolemy’s epicycles-upon-epicycles for the planetary orbits. Lewis (1973), however, distinguishes so-called quantitative parsimony from qualitative parsimony. He grants that his Realism may well violate quantitative parsimony, given the number of entities in his ontology, yet he suggests it is only qualitative parsimony that really matters. The latter just concerns the number of kinds that a theory acknowledges, rather than the raw number of entities themselves—and Lewis claims his Realism is indeed qualitatively parsimonious. After all, we already believe in the actual world, and Lewis is merely asking us to believe in more entities of that kind. In contrast, Meinongian Realism increases the kinds that entities exist. For Meinongian objects have “being” in a different kind of way than ordinary objects (or worse, they belong to a sui generis kind that lies “beyond being and non-being”).

A different issue that Lewis acknowledges concerns the epistemology of worlds. It is natural to think that causal interaction with x is required in order to know about x, as when the senses causally interact with the world. Yet for Lewis, there is no causal interaction between us and other worlds, and so knowledge of other worlds looks problematic. (The issue here is analogous to Benacerraf’s dilemma for Mathematical Realism.)

Lewis’ solution here is to say that knowledge of non-actual worlds does not require causal interaction. But if not, how do we acquire modal knowledge? His reply is that for the most part, our modal knowledge follows from our (tacit) knowledge of the Recombination Principle. Though typically, we do not strictly derive modal truths from the Principle; instead, we imagine some state-of-affairs and “test” it against the Principle. Yet even if we grant all this, Lewis may need to explain further how we know that this Principle accords precisely with the real modal facts.

Further worries about Lewis’ view concern the individuation of worlds. He contends that a continuous region of space-time is necessary and sufficient to individuate a world. More exactly, objects constitute a possible world just in case all the parts of the objects bear spatio-temporal relations to each other. (When they do, the objects are called “worldmates.”)  This, in conjunction with the spatio-temporal isolation of worlds, blocks the consequence that all possible worlds form one Big Possible World. Yet in this, Lewis is forced to say that no possible world contains isolated space-time regions. And as Lewis admits, it is counter-intuitive to say that. Still, he claims that such a possibility is “no central part of our modal thinking,” so he prefers to bite the bullet instead of rejecting his definitions of ‘worldmate’ and ‘world’ (1986, p. 71).

Another important critique of Lewis, expressed by Plantinga (1987), runs as follows. Suppose that physicists really did discover uncountably many alternative universes, each different from the others. Why, asks Plantinga, would we suppose that these have anything to do with modality? After all, intuitively, what is possible for me does not depend on facts about any “maximal objects” that exist; it is not as if facts about these spatiotemporally removed objects are what make it possible for me to be a dentist. Yet it is unclear how much force the point has; Lewis might reply that Plantinga’s “intuition” on this is merely a bias against his view.

Here is one further issue for Lewis’ account. One of its biggest advantages is supposedly that it avoids circularity—that is, it does not explicate our modal notions by utilizing a modal notion. (In contrast, circularity is a recurring problem for Lewis’ competitors, as we shall see.) However, Lycan (1994) has objected that Lewis’ analysis indeed employs a modal notion. Namely, ‘world’ in Lewis’ mouth means possible world, in contrast to the impossible worlds whose existence Lewis rejects. To be sure, if Lewis’ possible worlds genuinely exist, the facts about those worlds might metaphysically determine the modal facts unproblematically. But the issue is whether Lewis’ theory understands modal talk in completely nonmodal terms. Lycan’s point is that it does not, given that the theory rests on the distinction between “possible” and “impossible” worlds.

If Lewis were to surrender this distinction, so that ‘world’ denotes any kind of world whatsover, then ‘world’ could be a nonmodal term in Lewis’ primitive vocabulary. Indeed, many have said that Lewis should admit impossible worlds anyway, for the same kind of indispensability reasons in favor of possible worlds. (Impossible worlds facilitate the semantics of, for example, “Some round squares are round” or “Crazy people believe that some round squares exist.”) However, Lewis resists impossibilia, since he takes it as axiomatic that we can never assert a truth about an object by uttering a contradiction. Yet if Lewis’ worlds do not include impossible worlds, then his use of ‘world’ may indeed express a modal notion, meaning that circularity would again be a worry.

There is one final objection to Lewis we should note. Suppose for the sake of argument that Lewis has adequately answered the objections raised thus far. Still, the claim that the plentitude of worlds genuinely exists seems ridiculously, outrageously implausible by commonsense standards. This kind of reaction is what Lewis calls “The Incredulous Stare.” Lewis acknowledges that his view violates commonsense, even “to an extreme extent,” and that this is a liability for the theory. Nevertheless, he emphasizes that commonsense is not the final arbiter on what is philosophically best, and that the theoretical advantages of his Realism ultimately outweigh the disadvantages. Though, as he grants, this may be somewhat open to debate.

3. Ersatzism

We now come to the primary alternative to Modal Realism, the Ersatz approach. Most basically, the Ersatzer construes talk about a possible world as talk about some ersatz object. (‘Ersatz’ is German for ‘replacement’ or ‘substitute.') Thus the truth or falsity of a modal statement is explained by appeal to surrogates or proxies for possible worlds, rather than to genuinely existing worlds themselves. Thus, “It is possible for me to be a dentist” is true not because of a concretely existing alternate world, but rather because there is some ersatz world, according to which I am a dentist.

Different writers take different entities as their ersatz worlds, but the common idea is to use objects that are just plain actual, thus avoiding a Realist commitment to non-actuals. Yet to be clear, even though ersatz worlds are all actual, only one is actualized. This indicates another shared feature of worlds among Ersatzers; a world-surrogate is in some sense representational. After all, besides implying that some ersatz world “corresponds” to our world, the Ersatzers generally speak of what is true “according to a world.” Nevertheless, Ersatzers diverge on which actual representational objects should be the world-surrogate. The abstract objects recruited for this purpose include (a) sets of sentences, (b) sets of propositions or properties/relations, (c) pictorial objects, (d) combinations of matter and empty space (defined set-theoretically), and (e) objects that lack any specification beyond “abstract.” Let us review these options in turn.

a. Sententialism

One of the first Ersatz views was Rudolf Carnap’s (1947) Sententialism, where maximally consistent sets of sentences took the place of possible worlds. Writing before Kripke, however, Carnap did not speak of these sets as “ersatze” for worlds. He just utilized the sets as they were, referring to them as “state descriptions.” Still, posterior to Kripke’s modal logic, one might naturally assimilate state descriptions to ersatz worlds, since state descriptions fulfill the semantic role that is otherwise played by worlds.

According to Sententialism, then, truth or falsity of a sentence “Possibly, p” is ultimately a matter of whether some maximally consistent set contains the sentence “p” as a member. In similar fashion, “Necessarily, p” is true or false depending on whether all such sets contain “p.” Naturally, such a view requires an ontological commitment to sets, but such abstract objects might be required anyway (perhaps due to Quine-Putnam indispensability arguments). And a commitment to sets and the like may not seem quite as objectionable as a Realist’s commitment to nonactual objects.

Still, there are other issues. For one, the sets cannot just contain sentence-tokens (individual sentences that have actually been spoken or uttered), since there have only been finitely many tokens in the history of the world. (In contrast, every maximally consistent set patently contains infinitely many sentences.) Charitably speaking, then, Sententialism instead holds that ersatz worlds are sets of linguistic (or possibly mental) sentence-types. (Though, note, Lewis thinks that there are still cardinality problems unless the sentences are “Lagadonian,” where objects themselves are used as their own names). And so besides sets, the Ersatzer now may incur an ontological commitment to a further kind of abstract object, “types.”

Finally, the Sententialist faces a circularity worry. In utilizing maximally consistent sets, the Sententialist account depends on the modal notion of “consistency.” And unlike Lewis, the Sententialist cannot try to eliminate this notion by instead depending on robust facts about concrete possible worlds. So the Sententialist apparently takes as given one of the notions it wants to explicate.

b. Propositionalism and Property Ersatzism

It is notable that similar worries persist if the Ersatzer opts instead for maximally consistent sets of propositions, as in Plantinga (1972) and Adams (1974). This is obvious enough if propositions are identified with linguistic (or mental) sentence-types. And if propositions are construed as a different kind of abstract object, the number of ontological commitments seems to increase unnecessarily. Nonetheless, the Ersatzer might insist that the ontological cost here is not as high as it is with Lewisian worlds. (Though the problem remains that the Ersatzer apparently presupposes a modal notion of “consistency”)

Typically, a proposition is a complex of objects and properties/relations (or representations thereof). For instance, the proposition that I am a dentist would often be seen as composed of (representations of) myself and the property of being a dentist. But as noted in Lycan (1994), an Ersatzer can instead follow Parsons (1980), who individuates objects in terms of properties. (Unlike Parsons, however, the Ersatzer would regard the property-bundles as actual abstracta rather than Meinongian nonexistents.) In more detail, the Property Ersatzer identifies objects with bundles of properties (intuitively, the properties that the object has). And from these, worlds are built by describing relations between the property-groupings. One advantage of such an Ersatzism is that the property-groupings and their interrelations are all stipulated, meaning that unlike Lewis, the Ersatzer need not explain how knowledge of spatiotemporally isolated, concrete worlds is possible. Though again, the property-groupings must be “consistent,” meaning that circularity may be an issue here as well.

In fact, Property Ersatzers as well as Propositionalists have even more circularity worries when it comes to the metaphysics of the propositions or properties themselves. Many times, a proposition is defined by a set of possible worlds (intuitively, the worlds where the proposition is true)—whereas a property is often defined by a set of possible objects (intuitively, the objects that have the property in question). But both accounts depend on the notion of “possibility”, so they apparently cannot underwrite the Ersatzer’s propositions or properties, on pain of circularity.

Lewis gives two further objections to these Ersatz views. One is that if ersatz worlds are defined via properties, then it will be impossible to have distinct yet indiscernible objects. After all, for this Ersatzer, possible objects are individuated only by their properties—so if x and y are objects that have exactly the same properties, it would follow on this view that x = y. In addition, Lewis holds that such Ersatz accounts cannot allow other “alien” (that is, non-actual) properties, even though such properties seem possible. The intuition is that there might have been other properties than the properties we encounter in the actual world. But Property Ersatzers seem unable to accommodate this intuition. For they wish to limit themselves to actual abstracta when building the ersatz world. And that means non-actual abstracta, which would include non-actual properties, would not characterize any ersatz world.

Nevertheless, one could reply in typical Ersatz fashion that all properties, including alien properties, are actual abstract objects—it’s just that the alien properties are not actualized. Even so, Lewis replies that the Ersatzer should still provide individuation-conditions for alien properties. (Otherwise, the view would not secure the possibility of two objects differing only in alien properties.) But, says Lewis, since the Ersatzer denies the existence of alien properties, their individuation-conditions would presumably be supplied by some general theory of properties. Yet as we saw, the standard theory of properties would only create circularity in the Ersatzer’s account.

c. Pictorial Ersatzism

However, perhaps an Ersatzer can accommodate the possibility of alien properties in a different way. On this, Lewis considers a “Pictorial Ersatzer,” an Ersatzer who holds that all possible properties (including alien properties) are actually instantiated on abstract pictures. But to understand this properly, some further set-up is needed.

In general, the pictorial objects would act as ersatz worlds, representing the possible ways the world might be. Lewis suggests that the pictures would be representative, specifically, by isomorphism, by a mirroring between parts of the picture and parts of what is represented.  Strictly speaking, however, “isomorphism” is achieved by parts of the picture instantiating the very same properties and relations instantiated by the objects. Thus, a splotch of the picture would be isomorphic to the cat by having the very same shape and the very same color as the cat.

But of course, real pictures do not represent by such strict isomorphism. Yet the reason an oil paining can still represent a cat is because there are various conventions in place for us to associate cat-esque parts of the painting with real cats. Lewis thinks, however, that if Pictorial Ersatzism is meant to be a genuine alternative to Sententialism, such conventional elements must be absent from the pictorial ersatz worlds. Thus, Lewis proposes that these abstract pictorial objects should be idealized pictures which represent by a complete isomorphism (in as much as this is possible).

When it comes to alien properties, however, this idealization would prove helpful. The Ersatzer would hold that the alien properties are actually instantiated by abstract pictures (though they remain “alien” in being uninstantiated concretely.) And in brief, Lewis thinks this might allow the Ersatzer to individuate the alien properties. If so, then unlike the Property Ersatzer, the Pictorial Ersatzer could meet Lewis’ demand to individuate alien properties. She would do so, moreover, without invoking the standard general theory of properties (which, recall, would create circularity).

Regardless, Lewis identifies (at least) three difficulties for Pictorial Ersatzism. One is that the view presupposes rather than explicates the notion of “possible,” since the isomorphisms are each understood to hold between a picture and a possible scenario. Another is that the isomorphisms would fail, since an abstract ersatz cat is not a cat—an abstract object is not the sort of thing that can instantiate felinehood. Finally, it is dubious whether an ontological commitment to these world-pictures is better than a commitment to concrete worlds. For although every Ersatzer is committed to abstract objects, the Pictorial Ersatzer’s objects are not “abstract” in the usual senses of the term. Most notably, an abstract object is prototypically one that does not enter into spatio-temporal relations. Yet the isomorphism between the picture of the cat on the mat required a certain spatial arrangement of the parts. (Note that there are other ways to construe ‘abstract,’ but Lewis finds these no better.)

d. Combinatorialism

Combinatorialism is yet another view which prefers abstract surrogates over concrete possible worlds. The view has roots in the Ludwig Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, but interestingly it was Quine, our modal skeptic, who first developed it in some detail. Yet it was Creswell 1972 who first accepted and defended the view. According to the Combinatorialist, an ersatz world is roughly a set-theoretic construction of some distribution of matter throughout a space-time region. As an illustration, a Combinatorialist might start with a co-ordinate system in a four-dimensional Newtonian spacetime, and identify the position of each space-time point in the usual manner, using numerical values along the x-axis, the y-axis, and the z-axis. Next, we can assign a time t to each point, so that the spatial-temporal location of a point is completely defined by an ordered quadruple <x, y, z, t>. Finally, for each point in the co-ordinate system, we stipulate that the point either is filled with matter or is empty space, by assigning it the number 1 or 0, respectively. The result then represents a four-dimensional space-time where matter is distributed according to the 1s and 0s.  (Technical addendum: Since a space can be mapped by more than one co-ordinate system, a world is ultimately defined by an equivalence class of such systems.)

The example of course utilizes a Newtonian spacetime, but a Combinatorialist can identify other space-times, describe them by co-ordinate systems, and assign 1s and 0s as before. Regardless, there is always the chance that some possible space-time remains unidentified, leaving the combinatorial possibilities incomplete. Moreover, as Lewis highlights, our modal intuitions can be infirm about whether certain space-times are possible. For instance, is it possible to have entities which are temporally but not spatially located? In contrast, Lewis believes he has no need to answer this since he can just let the concrete modal facts fall where they may.

As might be expected, circularity is also a worry for this brand of Ersatzism. Perhaps the best way to levy the charge is by considering how a distribution of simples relates to macro states-of-affairs. In the first instance, the set-theoretic constructions determine the position of a world’s mereological atoms (that is, indivisible parts making up a whole), yet the assumption is that this also determines all the goings-on in the world at the macro-level. But in what sense “determines?” This would seem to concern the micro-facts metaphysically necessitating the macro-facts in a world. Yet metaphysical necessitation is of course a modal notion. So as before, it appears the Ersatzer has a circular analysis on her hands.

On a different note, the Combinatorialist should be concerned that her worlds only contain matter. After all, this implies that materialism is necessarily true—even though spiritual entities like Cartesian souls would seem to be at least possible. Now the Combinatorialist may simply bite the bullet here; after all, the fact that people believe in spiritual entities does not show their possibility (although, if propositions are sets of worlds, then it is harder to characterize those beliefs without worlds containing such entities). Or, a Combinatorialist might instead propose a kind of “neutral monism” whereby arrangements of atoms can result in either material or immaterial objects. Admittedly, however, it is hard to see how immaterial objects could be composed of “atoms,” much less the same type of “atoms” as material objects.

There is a further concern about the metaphysics of the atoms. Since the Combinatorialists wants to avoid non-actual objects, it seems her set-theoretic constructions must include only actual atoms. This is unfortunate, however, since limiting ourselves to actual matter rules out possible worlds with more matter than in our world, as well as worlds with different matter.

Nevertheless, a Combinatorialist may try to avoid both this problem and the problem about immaterial possibilia by recruiting (say) numbers as substitutes for non-actual substances. Yet it is unclear whether this is satisfactory, since numbers do not literally represent anything (much less represent nonactual matter); hence, the numbers will apparently be chosen arbitrarily. Consequently, once we have a set-theoretic construction using these numbers, we may be strained to believe that this specific construction really is what determines the truth of our modal statements. For why should this particular construction earn this status, over a structurally identical one that uses different numbers?

e. Non-Reductivism

A rather different approach is that of Stalnaker (1984) and (on one reading) Plantinga (1972). As in other Ersatz views, concrete possible worlds are replaced with actual abstract objects. But these ersatz worlds are simply identified as “maximal states-of-affairs” or “ways the world might have been” without further analysis in terms of sentences, propositions, universals, or anything else. Non-Reductionist Ersatzism may very well have some appeal, especially in light of the perceived failures of other Ersatz accounts, though talk of “maximal” states-of-affairs alone may be enough to make the account circular.

Note that even if the ersatz worlds are ontologically basic, they can nonetheless have structure. In line with Kripke’s logic, the Non-Reductivist can say that her worlds consist of states-of-affairs, which in turn are comprised of individuals and their properties/relations. Interestingly, Plantinga includes individual essences as well, sometimes called “hacceities”; such a thing is possessed by an individual necessarily, and is necessarily unique to the individual.

But at the most basic level, the Non-Reductivist simply interprets Kripke’s logic with respect to a domain of abstract objects, which are not analyzed in terms of anything more ontologically fundamental. Lewis thus calls the view “non-descript” Ersatzism, complaining that the theory is not much of a theory at all. (Lewis levies this criticism against a view he calls “Magical Ersatzism,” where ersatz worlds are structureless, mereological atoms. But he thinks the point carries over.) In fact, since Non-Reductivism is simply silent on reductive matters, it thus seems compatible with any of the reductions given by other Ersatzers. Lewis even suggests it compatible with reducing possible states-of-affairs to sets of Lewisian concrete worlds (if the sets are actual abstracta).

The Non-Reductivist can respond, however, by explicitly denying such reductions. But in that case, her ersatz worlds start to look like abstract objects that cannot be given any further reduction. Yet this would not put her at a disadvantage, says the Non-Reductivist, since Lewis’ Realism apparently cannot reduce concrete possibilia into more basic facts either.

Still, Lewis thinks the Ersatzer owes us more about what makes the modal truths true, if not concrete facts. And apparently, the Non-Reductivist is simply taking as primitive the crucial explanatory notions like “states-of-affairs,” “properties,” and so forth. What’s more, recall that the ersatz worlds are supposed to be representational, since certain things are true “according to a world.” Yet Non-Reductivism just leaves this representational feature as mysterious. (In contrast, Sententialism can explain the representational nature of its ersatz worlds by the representational nature of sentences.)

4. Fictionalism

A later approach to come on the scene is the Fictionalist view of possibilia. Fictionalism proper was first developed by Gideon Rosen (1990), although Armstrong’s (1989) view is expressly Fictionalist in part, as we shall see in the next section. Notably, Rosen does not always identify himself as a Fictionalist, and similarly with Daniel Nolan (who is arguably the leading expert on Fictionalism in the early 21st century). Nonetheless, the Fictionalist strategy has garnered a lot of attention, since at the least, it may be no more problematic than the Ersatz views. Plus, it can be applied to other problematic objects besides possible worlds, “moral facts” for example.

As concerns possible worlds, the Fictionalist says that a statement about such worlds should be understood as analogous to a statement like “According to Arthur Conan Doyle’s stories, Sherlock Holmes lives at 221B Baker Street in London.” Note first that Holmes-statement is false if we leave off the clause “According to the…stories,” also known as the “story-prefix." After all, it’s not literally true that Sherlock Holmes lives in London. Yet when the story-prefix is added, the assertion is indeed literally true. For there literally are sentences in the Doyle stories which specify this as the location of Holmes’ home.

In an analogous manner, the Fictionalist suggests that “There is some possible world with a talking donkey” is false strictly speaking, since (with all due respect to David Lewis) there are no such worlds. Nonetheless, it is entirely true to say “According to Lewis’ theory, there is some possible world with a talking donkey.” Taking this as her cue, the Fictionalist says that for any modal statement p, the statement is true if and only if, according to Lewis’ view, p.

One advantage that Fictionalism has over Lewis’ Realism is that the view is not as apt to provoke the “Incredulous Stare” by ignoring commonsense. A second advantage is that the Fictionalist does not have the same troubles with the epistemology of worlds. Recall: Lewis’ difficulty was that we bear no causal relationships to non-actual worlds, meaning that our epistemic access to these worlds seems problematic. Lewis responded by explaining modal knowledge via “imaginative tests,” where we judge whether an imaginary scenario is possible using the Principle of Recombination. One complaint against Lewis, then, is that these tests provide knowledge of the concrete existing worlds only if we antecedently know that the Recombination Principle provides for exactly the possibilities found in those worlds. However, the Fictionalist does not face this problem. Since she denies the concrete existence of the worlds, she can hold that the “imaginative tests” are enough for modal knowledge. After all, on her view, what Lewis’ Recombination Principle says (in conjunction with the rest of Lewis’ view) wholly determines what is possible. And to know what Lewis’ theory says, one does not need knowledge of any correspondence with concretely existing worlds.

Yet Fictionalism of course is not without its problems. One is that in talking of stories such as the PWF (Possible World Fiction), the Fictionalist would seem committed to a certain kind of abstract object, namely, “stories.” Rosen nonetheless sees this commitment as less severe than the Lewisian commitment to worlds. However, if the Fictionalist accepts that the PWF exists as an abstract story, understood as a set of sentences, then it may not be entirely clear how her view differs from Sententialist Ersatzism.

A second difficulty is that, according to Lewis’ Realism, Modal Realism is necessarily true—that is, Modal Realism is true at every world. And the Fictionalist holds that the truth of “Necessarily, p” is determined by whether Lewis’ Realism says “Necessarily, p.” Hence, if Lewis’ Realism says that Realism is necessary, the Fictionalist is then committed to the truth of “Necessarily, Lewis’ Realism is true,” and thereby surrenders her Fictionalism in favor of Modal Realism.

However, it has been subsequently argued that Lewis’ (1969) Realism does not entail the necessity of the view. It is key that Lewis’ early version of Modal Realism holds that “‘There are x’ is true at a world iff x exists in that world,” that is, as a spatio-temporal part of that world. But if so, then ‘There are multiple worlds’ will be true in no possible world. For within the space-time of a world W, there will only be one world that exists as an (improper) part, namely W itself.

A separate obstacle for Fictionalism is that Lewis is agnostic on certain modal matters, for example, the possible sizes of space-time. Such agnosticism is no threat to Lewis’ own metaphysics, since real concrete facts will determine whichever space-times are possible. But how does Fictionalist fix the facts here? In such a case, a Fictionalist might say that it is literally false that, for example, there is a possible spacetime that houses uncountably many donkeys. After all, it is false to say “According to the PWF, there is a possible world containing uncountably many donkeys,” for Lewis never says if space-time could contain that many donkeys. Yet Rosen points out that, given Lewis’ silence, the contrary statement “no possible spacetime houses uncountably many donkeys” would also come out false. And so, contrary statements would have the same truth-value. Consequently, Rosen instead advises the Fictionalist to leave such statements without a truth-value.

Another glaring issue for the Fictionalist is to give an adequate semantics of her story-prefix.  A standard sort of semantics would say that a statement of the form “According to the PWF, p” means “In a possible world where the PWF is true, p.” Yet if the Fictionalist analyzes possible-worlds statements in terms of story-prefixed statements, she cannot also analyze the latter in terms of the former, on pain of circularity. Of course, one might forego the possible-worlds analysis of the story-prefix and give a Meinongian account instead. But the typical Fictionalist is aiming for a slim ontology. As a final option, then, the Fictionalist might simply take her story-prefix as primitive. Though as Rosen says, this is hard to stomach especially if the story-prefixed statements occasionally lack a truth-value (in accordance with Rosen’s advice above). Besides, says Rosen, story-prefixes seem to have a compound structure that should be analyzable into more basic terms.

On a related matter, the Fictionalist seems to face a dilemma. Since PWF is a fiction, the claims it makes are false—yet is the PWF contingently or necessarily false? It is natural to understand “According to PWF, p” as saying that “if PWF were true, then p would be true.” Yet if the PWF is necessarily false, then the antecedent of this conditional is necessarily false. And that means the conditional will be true, even if p is an impossible proposition. On the other horn of the dilemma, if PWF is contingently false, then Fictionalism is inadequate to explicate the truth of “the PWF is contingently false.” For the Fictionalist would construe this as entailing “According to the PWF, there is a possible world where the PWF is true.” And per the schema above, that is equivalent to the truism “If the PWF were true, then the truth of the PWF would be possible.” Yet this is not equivalent to the claim that the PWF might have been true, since the latter is entirely nontrivial.

Nolan raises yet another objection concerning the “artificiality” of fiction. It seems we can create fictional states-of-affairs at whim, but modal matters do not seem so arbitrary. It thus seems we need to specify which fiction is the “right” fiction for possible worlds. Yet what would make the PWF the “right” fiction? Since the Fictionalist is not a Realist, she cannot say that the right fiction is the one that corresponds to the real possible worlds. But then, what would “rightness” consist in?

Finally, the Fictionalist also faces a more general circularity worry. Even if we ignore cases where Lewis is agnostic, the PWF will have gaps since it does not explicitly list every modal statement. So it seems that for the Fictionalist, some modal truths are true because they are entailed by the PWF. Yet entailment is a modal notion; a conjunction of statements entails a statement just in case it is impossible for the conjunction to be true and the latter false. So once again, our analysis of possible worlds seems to use one of the modal notions it was supposed to explicate.

5. Armstrong’s Hybrid

David Armstrong offers us a different type of modal metaphysics which is Ersatzist in part, but also partly Fictionalist. Most basically, however, Armstrong wants a “Naturalist” metaphysics, a metaphysics where anything that exists (i) has a location in actual space-time, and also (ii) enters into causal relations. This is in opposition to the Ersatz views which seem only to swap Lewis’ worlds for other ontologically dubious entities, namely, actual yet non-locatable abstracta. The Naturalism that drives Armstrong’s project will thus result in several notable modifications to both the Ersatzist and Fictionalist aspects of his view.

In general, it is fair to say that Armstrong adopts the Combinatorialist strategy of using combinatorial possibilities as ersatz worlds. But in line with Naturalism, Armstrong rejects the abstract set-theoretic constructions which the typical Combinatorialist posits. Instead, a possible world is construed as an ungrouped plurality or “heap” of elements.

As a further departure from the usual Combinatorialism, Armstrong’s elements are not mereological simples (that is, indivisible parts)—rather, they are whole states-of-affairs (which may or may not involve simples). The reason is that Armstrong sees states-of-affairs as more ontologically basic than particulars and their properties/relations, since those have no existence apart from states-of-affairs. He grants, however, that we may consider particulars and properties/relations in abstraction from states-of-affairs. So in some epistemic sense, it is true that Armstrong recombines particulars and their properties/relations, similar to other Combinatorialists. But from the more relevant, ontological angle, Armstrong’s combinations have states-of-affairs as the combinatorial elements, since nothing is more ontologically fundamental than these.

Armstrong’s worlds thus exist as “heaps” of states-of-affairs. However, only one heap is actual, so it may seem that Armstrong needs to posit non-actuals anyway, against his Naturalism. Yet Armstrong believes this conflict is resolvable if we think of non-actual heaps as fictional objects akin to “ideal” scientific entities, for example, ideal gasses, frictionless planes, perfect vacuums, and so forth. For although ideal scientific entities seem to be fictitious, our tendency is nonetheless to view, for example, the ideal gas laws as literally true. That is, we do not see the ideal gas laws as simply “true in fiction” in the way that we regard “Sherlock Holmes lives at 221B Baker Street” as merely true in fiction. But if we view these laws as literally true, it that would mean the ideal entities literally enter into causal relations and occupy space-time. And if so, then such fictitious entities would meet the constraints imposed by Naturalism.

Of course, not everyone is happy with Armstrong’s picture. The most important objection is that Armstrong does not describe the metaphysics of his fictions, beyond comparing them to frictionless surfaces and perfect vacuums. And it is not clear what account he could give. Naturalism of course precludes a Meinongian view of such objects, but also, the standard counterfactual analysis of fiction would result in circularity. As with other Fictionalists, Armstrong could not analyze worlds using fiction, and also analyze fictional discourse using counterfactual worlds.

Another point of contention is the anti-essentialism which is part of Armstrong’s view. Many philosophers follow Kripke (1972) in holding that at least some individuals have essential properties, properties that they necessarily exhibit. (So for instance, Bertrand Russell is essentially a member of homo sapiens.) However, Armstrong puts no constraints on what properties a possible individual might instantiate. Consequently, the view entails that it is possible (say) for Bertrand Russell to be a poached egg—though the current philosophical trends at the beginning of the 21st century are against such a thing.

6. Quine's Skepticism

So far the views here have all assumed Realism about modal truths, even though most refuse Realism about possible worlds. That is, they all assume that a statement like “I might have been a dentist” can be literally true, even though what makes it true may be something other than a concretely existing alternative world. Yet the reader can verify that Lewis’ Realism, Ersatzism, Fictionalism, the Armstrong Hybrid, and Conventionalism face circularity worries; each seems to implicitly deploy a modal notion in the analysis of modal notions. But to W.V.O. Quine, this would hardly come as a surprise. Quine argues that such circularity is in fact ineliminable, and that our modal notions are therefore defective. If so, the implication seems to be an Anti-Realism about modal truth or that modal notions cannot be used in expressing legitimate truths.

Quine’s argument here is found in his “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” (one of the most celebrated philosophical article of the twentieth century). In the main, the paper concerns whether the terms ‘analytic’ and ‘synthetic’ can be properly defined, even provided the stock examples of analytic statements, for example, ‘Bachelors are unmarried men.' Yet Quine’s investigation bears on modal terms as well, since he presumes that a statement would be analytic if and only if it is necessary. (Against the philosophical lore, Quine is aware that this is contentious; see Quine 1960, p. 66; see below as well.) The upshot is that, for Quine, if one could appropriately define ‘analytic’, this would bring us closer to understanding modal terms.

A traditional definition of analyticity (from Kant) is dismissed as metaphorical, since it simply says that in an analytic statement, the predicate is “contained” in the subject. A different suggestion is that analytic statements are either logical truths or “true by definition.” The latter kind of truth would be a statement with a predicate that is synonymous with the subject-term, where synonyms could be listed by dictionary definitions. But for Quine, this just pushes back the question onto “synonymy.” When do terms count as synonymous?

One of the main proposals here is that synonyms are terms that can replace each other in the statements they occur, without altering the truth-values of those statements. (Quotational contexts and propositional attitude reports will be exceptions, but they could be catalogued as such.) Yet Quine worries that ‘creature with a heart’ and ‘creature with a kidney’ might pass this substitutivity test, since they supposedly co-refer, despite being non-synonymous. But in fact, these phrases do not intersubstitute, in a sentence like “Necessarily, a creature with a heart is a creature with a heart.” For while this statement is true, it is false that “Necessarily, a creature with a heart is a creature with a kidney.”

However, Quine protests that our definition of synonymy cannot rest on the notion of necessity, for otherwise we will have gone in a small definitional circle. Recall that Quine presumes necessity would be definable in terms of analyticity, but the present suggestion ultimately explicates analyticity in terms of necessity (via the notion of synonymy). So at best, the result is a rather tight circle of definitions.

Regardless, if we are presently unable to define these notions adequately, it does not follow that we will never be able to. But this is partly why, at the end of “Two Dogmas,” Quine provides a very general picture of the relations between statements, where the analytic/synthetic distinction (and the necessary/possible distinction) apparently can have no application. The picture, known as the “web of belief,” is one which (in the first instance) jettisons the idea that an individual hypothesis can be confirmed or disconfirmed by experience. Instead, a statement must first be embedded in an entire network of statements. Without going into the details, however, a consequence of this confirmation holism is that a disconfirming experience can motivate a revision of any statement in the network. Hence, Quine thinks it could conceivably be rational to revise even logical truths such as the Law of Excluded Middle in light of experimental results from quantum physics. More generally, since experience may prompt any statement to be revised, Quine sees it as folly to speak of statements that are analytic or necessarily true—that is, true no matter what.

A number of objections have been raised against Quine. Kripke (1972) suggests that there is a tendency to conflate notions of analyticity, necessity, and the a priori. Yet these notions are clearly different: As Kripke says, analyticity is a semantic notion, necessity is a metaphysical notion, and the apriori is an epistemic one. Kripke then argues further that some necessities are aposteriori, such as ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’, (and as a lesser point, that some contingencies seem apriori, such as ‘I am here now’). However, charitably Quine recognizes that different concepts are in play here. (It would be odd for him to speak of a definitional circle if he thought only one concept was in play.)

Even so, Quine apparently assumes that these concepts are co-extensional, and Kripke’s aposteriori necessities would discredit that. Yet Quine could reply that his concern is mainly with analyticity and necessity, and not the apriori. (It is notable that ‘apriori’ only occurs once in “Two Dogmas of Empiricism,” and merely as a rhetorical flourish.) Thus if Quine merely assumes that the necessities = the analyticities, Kripke’s examples of aposteriori truths have no immediate relevance. Still, many assume that Kripke’s aposteriori necessities are also synthetic truths. And if that is so, then Quine is wrong to assume that all necessities would be analytic. (But note, since “aposteriori” and “synthetic” are different notions, it may remain a bit unclear why aposteriori necessities must be synthetic.)

As concerns the “web of belief,” Grice & Strawson (1956) argue that this picture does not in fact preclude an analytic/synthetic distinction. For it is possible to distinguish cases where we revise a statement’s truth-value, from cases where we revise a statement’s meaning. As a simple example, suppose you believe that all swans are white (along with suitable auxiliary hypotheses). Yet suppose you see a black swan while traveling in Australia. Then, Grice & Strawson would say that you could either revise your belief about swans, or you could revise what you mean by ‘swan.’ In the latter case, you might revise ‘swan’ to mean “white swan” specifically. And then it would seem that “All swans are white” is analytic, since it simply amounts to the logical truth that “All white swans are white.”

For Quine, however, reducing “All swans are white” to a logical truth does not show it to be analytic or necessary, since even logical truths are revisable (as quantum physics seems to illustrate). Still, Quine’s views are radically at odds with the current philosophical orthodoxies, and so many philosophers remain unconvinced. One clear sign of this is the recent revival of conventionalism. This is the view that truths about what is possible or what is necessary are determined by linguistic convention, rather than by possible worlds, ersatz worlds, or the like. Such a view states that, pace Quine, logical truths are necessarily true, since linguistic conventions (more or less) stipulate them to be such. In earlier work, Quine (1936) more directly attacks such “truth by convention;” the reader is referred to Sider (2003), section 4, for an introduction to this debate. But interestingly, the conventionalist and Quine apparently would agree that facts about concrete or ersatz worlds do not ground modal statements. So regardless of whether Quine or the conventionalist is right, the primary lesson of this section stands, namely, that metaphysical accounts of possible worlds might be mistaken not just in detail, but in their most basic assumptions.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. (1989). A Combinatorial Theory of Possibility, Cambridge: Cambridge UP
    • Presents Armstrong’s hybrid of Combinatorialism and Fictionalism, putatively in line with Naturalist ontology.
  • Carnap, R. (1947). Meaning and Necessity, Chicago: U of Chicago Press.
    • Historically the first articulation of the Sententialist view.
  • Cresswell, M. J. (1972). “The World is Everything that is the Case,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, vol. 50, pp. 113.
    • The first defense of a Combinatorialist view akin to that of Quine (1968).
  • de Rosset, L. (2009a). Possible Worlds I: Modal Realism, Philosophy Compass, 4(6), 998-1008.
    • This, along with Part II below, provide a useful overview of the latest developments in the debate regarding Modal Realism vs. its competitors.
  • de Rosset, L. (2009b). Possible Worlds II:  Nonreductive Theories of Possible Worlds, Philosophy Compass, 4(6), 1009-1021.
  • Divers, J. (2002). Possible Worlds, London: Routledge.
    • An detailed introduction  to the dialectic between Modal Realists and Ersatzers.
  • Grice, H. P. & P. F. Strawson (1956). “In Defense of a Dogma,” Philosophical Review, vol. 65, pp. 141-158.
    • Contains some of the most important criticisms of Quine (1953).
  • Kripke, S.A. (1959). A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 24(1), pp. 1–14.
    • This is where it all started; it presents Kripke’s logic for modal statements.
  • Kripke, S.A.  (1972). “Naming and Necessity,” in Davidson, D. & Harman, G., (eds.) Semantics of Natural Language, Dordrecht: Reidel, 253-355 & 763-769.    Reprinted as Naming and Necessity, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP, 1980.
    • Provides an extremely influential theory of names and their behavior in modal statements. Also, it is cited when accusing Quine of conflating analyticity, necessity, and the a priori.
  • Lewis, D. (1969). Convention: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP.
    • Contains Lewis’ first statement of his Realism, also includes a noteworthy preface by Quine.
  • Lewis, D. (1972). Counterfactuals, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP.
    • Another articulation of Lewis’ Realism; this is also the main source for Lewis on counterparts.
  • Lewis, D. (1986). On the Plurality of Worlds, Cambridge, MA: Blackwell.
    • A sustained defense of Lewis’ Realism, and an attack on the alternative, Ersatz views. The most important primary source in modal metaphysics.
  • Lewis, D. (1999). Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology, Cambridge: Cambridge UP.
    • Contains several relevant papers on modal metaphysics, including Lewis’ criticisms of Routley (a contemporary Meinongian) and of Armstrong.
  • Lycan, W. (1979). The Trouble with Possible Worlds, in Loux, M. (ed.), The Possible and the Actual, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, pp. 274-316.
    • Contains some historically important criticisms of Lewis’ Realism. Also sketches a Propositionalist/Property Ersatz view.
  • Lycan, W. (1994). Modality and Meaning, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
    • Chapter 1-4 revise and expand the material from Lycan (1979). The book is a highly effective overview and response to the literature on modal metaphysics. Deserves to be widely read.
  • Meinong, A. (1904). “The Theory of Objects,” in Realism and the Background of Phenomenology, trans. I. Levi, D. B. Terrell, and R. Chisholm. Free Press, 1960.
    • Contains the slogan “There are objects of which it is true to say that there are no such objects.” One of the few pieces by Meinong widely available in English.
  • Melia, J. (2003). Modality, Montreal: McGill-Queen’s University Press.
    • An excellent introduction to many of the issues presented in this article.
  • Nolan, D. (2002). Topics in the Philosophy of Possible Worlds, New York: Routledge.
    • Nolan’s dissertation, contains several useful reflections on Fictionalism.
  • Plantinga, A. (1974) The Nature of Necessity, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
    • Plantinga’s magnum opus on modality. Highlights include the discussion of counterpart theory and trans-world identity in Chapter 6, and the treatment of fictional objects in Chapter 8. Also, Plantinga’s modal version of Anselm’s ontological argument is not to be missed (Chapter 10).
  • Plantinga, A. (2003). Essays on the Metaphysics of Modality, M. Davidson (ed.), Oxford: Oxford UP.
    • A handy collection of Plantinga’s work in the area, including Chapter 8 of Plantinga (1974). It also has Plantinga’s (1972) modal metaphysics, as well as his (1987) relevance objection to Lewis’ Realism.
  • Quine, W. V. (1936). Truth by Convention, Reprinted in The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays, Revised edition, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP, (1976), pp. 77-106.
    • Contains Quine’s best-known critique of the idea of “truth by convention.”
  • Quine, W.V. (1953). Two Dogmas of Empiricism, Reprinted in From a Logical Point of View, 2nd edition (pp. 20-46). Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP.
    • Presents Quine’s arguments against the analytic/synthetic distinction, and the necessary/possible distinction. Required reading for any student of philosophy.
  • Quine, W.V. (1968). “Propositional Objects,” in Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, Cambridge, MA: Harvard UP, (pp. 139-160)
    • Provides the first developed version of Combinatorialism, though Quine ultimately rejects the view.
  • Rosen, G. (1990). Modal Fictionalism, Mind 99 (395), pp. 327-354.
    • The first place where Fictionalism is developed in detail, as a modal metaphysics in its own right.
  • Sider, T. (2003). Reductive Theories of Modality, in Loux & Zimmerman (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Metaphysics, New York: Oxford UP, pp. 180-208.
    • Section 4 is a very useful introduction to conventionalism about modality; other sections are helpful as well regarding Modal Realism, Fictionalism, and the various Ersatzisms.
  • Stalnaker, R. (1984). Inquiry, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Presents a Non-Reductivist metaphysics, the last chapter is explicitly devoted to comparing Non-Reductivism to Reductivism.


Author Information

Ted Parent
Virginia Polytechnic Institute and State University
U. S. A.

John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart (1866—1925)

McTaggartJ. M. E. McTaggart is a British idealist, best known for his argument for the unreality of time and for his system of metaphysics advocating personal idealism. By the early twentieth century, the philosophical movement known as British Idealism was waning, while the ‘new realism’ (later dubbed ‘analytic philosophy’) was gaining momentum. Although McTaggart’s commitment to idealism never faltered, he enjoyed an usually close relationship with several of the new realists. McTaggart spent almost his entire career at Trinity College, Cambridge, and there he taught Bertrand Russell, G. E. Moore and C. D. Broad. McTaggart influenced all of these figures to some degree, and all of them speak particularly highly of his careful and clear philosophical method.

McTaggart studied Hegel from the very beginning of his philosophical career and produced a large body of Hegel scholarship, including the mammoth Studies in Hegelian Cosmology (1901). Towards the end of his career he produced his two volume magnum opus The Nature of Existence (1921 & posthumously 1927), a highly original metaphysical system developing─what McTaggart took to be─Hegel’s ontology. This personal idealism holds that the universe is composed solely of minds and their perceptions, bound into a tight unity by love. However, McTaggart is best known for his influential paper “The Unreality of Time” in which he argues that change and time are contradictory and unreal. This argument, and the metaphysical groundwork it lays down, especially its contrast between his A-series and B-series of time, is still widely discussed.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Philosophical Influences
    1. The British Idealists
    2. The British New Realists
  3. Philosophical Writings
    1. Hegel
    2. Some Dogmas of Religion
    3. The Unreality of Time
    4. The Nature of Existence
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Selected Secondary Sources

1. Biography

McTaggart was born in London on 3 September 1866, the son of Francis Ellis, a county court judge, and his wife Caroline Ellis. McTaggart was born ‘John McTaggart Ellis’ and acquired the name ‘McTaggart’ as a surname when his father adopted it on condition of inheriting an uncle’s wealth. As a boy McTaggart attended a preparatory school in Weybridge, from which he was expelled for his frequent avowal of atheism. He subsequently attended school in Caterham and Clifton College, Bristol. He began studying philosophy at Trinity College, Cambridge in 1885. Once McTaggart began at Trinity, he hardly left: he graduated in 1888 with a first class degree, became a Prize Fellow in 1891, became a lecturer in Moral Sciences in 1897 and stayed until his retirement in 1923. In a letter to a friend, he writes of Cambridge: ‘Unless I am physically or spiritually at Cambridge or Oxford, I have no religion, no keenness (I do not identify them) except by snatches. I must have been made for a don... I learn a good many things there, the chief one being that I am a damned sight happier than I deserve to be’. In addition to being an academic, McTaggart was a mystic. He reports having visions ─ not imaginary, but literal perceptions of the senses ─ conveying the spiritual nature of the world; this may have played a part in his unswerving devotion to idealism. McTaggart investigates the nature of mysticism in “Mysticism” ─ reprinted in his Philosophical Studies (1934) ─ and he takes it to involve an awareness of the unity of the universe.

Beginning in 1891, McTaggart took a number of trips to New Zealand to visit his mother, and it was there that he met his future wife. He married Margaret Elizabeth Bird in New Zealand on 5 August 1899, and subsequently removed her to Cambridge. They had no children. During the first World War, McTaggart worked as a special constable and helped in a munitions factory. McTaggart’s friend Dickinson writes of him, ‘it is essential to remember that, if he was a philosopher by nature and choice he was also a lover and a husband... and a whole-hearted British patriot’ (Dickinson, 1931, 47).

Towards the end of his life McTaggart produced the first volume of his magnum opus The Nature of Existence (1921). He retired shortly afterwards in 1923, and died unexpectedly two years later on 18 January 1925. In his introduction to the second edition of Some Dogmas of Religion, McTaggart’s friend and former student Broad describes McTaggart’s funeral and mentions how one of McTaggart’s favourite Spinozistic passages were read out. It is worth mentioning here that, although McTaggart never contributed to Spinoza scholarship, he admired him greatly ─ perhaps even more than Hegel. McTaggart describes Spinoza as a great religious teacher, ‘in whom philosophical insight and religious devotion were blended as in no other man before or since’ (McTaggart, 1906, 299). The passage from Spinoza was consequently engraved on McTaggart’s memorial bass in Trinity College. McTaggart did not live to see the second volume of The Nature of Existence in print but fortunately the manuscript was largely complete and it was finally published in 1927, under Broad’s careful editorial care. Broad describes McTaggart as follows:

‘Take an eighteenth-century English Whig. Let him be a mystic. Endow him with the logical subtlety of the great schoolmen and their belief in the powers of human reason, with the business capacity of a successful lawyer, and with the lucidity of the best type of French mathematician. Inspire him (Heaven knows how) in early youth with a passion for Hegel. Then subject him to the teaching of Sidgwick and the continual influence of Moore and Russell. Set him to expound Hegel. What will be the result? Hegel himself could not have answered this question a priori, but the course of world history has solved it ambulando by producing McTaggart.’

For further biographical information (and anecdotes) see Dickinson’s (1931) biographical sketch of McTaggart, and Broad’s (1927) notice on McTaggart.

2. Philosophical Influences

McTaggart was active in British philosophy at a time when it was caught between two opposing philosophical currents ─ British Idealism and the New Realism ─ and McTaggart was involved with figures within both of these movements.

a. The British Idealists

McTaggart began his career in British philosophy when it was firmly under the sway of British Idealism, a movement which argues that the world is inherently unified, intelligible and idealist. Due to the influence of Hegel on these philosophers, the movement is also sometimes known as British Hegelianism. The movement began in the latter half of the nineteenth century; J. H. Stirling is generally credited with introducing Hegel’s work to Britain via his book The Secret of Hegel (1865). Aside from McTaggart himself, important figures in British Idealism include T. H. Green, F. H. Bradley, Harold Joachim, Bernard Bosanquet and Edward Caird. Early on, a schism appeared in the movement as to how idealism should be understood. Absolute idealists ─ such as Bradley ─ argued that reality is underpinned by a single partless spiritual unity known as the Absolute. In contrast, personal idealists ─ such as G. F. Stout and Andrew Seth ─ argued that reality consists of many individual spirits or persons. McTaggart firmly endorses personal idealism, the doctrine that he took to be Hegel’s own. In addition to his idealism, McTaggart shared other neo-Hegelian principles. Among these are his convictions that the universe is as tightly unified as it is possible for a plurality of existents to be, that the universe is fundamentally rational and open to a priori investigation, and his disregard for naturalism. On this last point, McTaggart goes so far as to say that, while science may investigate the nature of the universe, only philosophy investigates its ‘ultimate nature’ (McTaggart, 1906, 273).

Nearly all of McTaggart’s early work concerns Hegel, or Hegelian doctrines, and this work forms the basis of the metaphysical system he would later develop in so much detail. A good example of this is his earliest publication, a pamphlet printed for private circulation entitled “The Further Determination of the Absolute” (1893); it is reprinted in McTaggart’s Philosophical Studies. In this defence of idealism, McTaggart’s Hegelian credentials are well established: he repeatedly references Hegel, Green, and Bradley ─ whom he later describes as ‘the greatest of all living philosophers'. McTaggart apparently cared  greatly about this paper. In its introduction, McTaggart apologises for its ‘extreme crudeness... and of its absolute inadequacy to its subject’. In private correspondence (see Dickinson) McTaggart describes the experience of writing it. ‘It has been shown to one or two people who are rather authorities (Caird of Glasgow and Bradley of Oxford) and they have been very kind and encouraging about it... [writing] it was almost like turning one’s heart out’.

b. The British New Realists

Despite his close philosophical ties to British Idealism, McTaggart bucked the trends of the movement in a number of ways. (In fact, Broad (1927) goes so far as to say that English Hegelianism filled McTaggart with an ‘amused annoyance’). To begin with, McTaggart spent his entire career at Cambridge. Not only was Oxford, rather than Cambridge, the spiritual home of British Idealism but Cambridge became the home of new realism. While at Trinity College, McTaggart taught a number of the new realists ─ including Moore, Russell and Broad ─ and held great influence over them. Moore read and gave notes on a number of McTaggart’s works prior to publication, including Some Dogmas of Religion (1906) and the first volume of The Nature of Existence. In his obituary note on McTaggart, Moore describes him as a philosopher ‘of the very first rank’ (Moore, 1925, 271). For more on McTaggart’s influence on Moore, see Baldwin (1990). McTaggart was also involved with some of the realist debates of the time; for example, see his discussion note on Wittgenstein “Propositions Applicable to Themselves”, reprinted in his Philosophical Studies (1906).

As a young philosopher, Russell was so impressed by McTaggart’s paper “The Further Determination of the Absolute” and its doctrine of philosophical love that he used it to woo his future wife. In his autobiography, Russell writes that he remembers wondering as a student ‘as an almost unattainable ideal, whether I should ever do work as good as McTaggart’s’ (Russell, 1998, 129). Later, their relationship soured; McTaggart took a leading role in the expulsion of Russell from his fellowship following Russell’s controversial pacifist wartime writings. For more on this, and on McTaggart’s more general influence on Russell, see Dickinson (1931) and Griffin (1984). McTaggart, Russell and Moore were described at one point as ‘The Mad Tea Party of Trinity’, with McTaggart painted as the Dormouse.

As for Broad, McTaggart describes him as his ‘most brilliant’ pupil. Broad edited the two volumes of McTaggart’s The Nature of Existence, and produced extensive studies of both. Both Moore and Broad heap praise upon McTaggart for his exceptional clarity and philosophic rigour; the lack of these qualities in other idealists played a part in driving both of these new realists away from British Idealism. For example, Broad writes: ‘The writings of too many eminent Absolutists seem to start from no discoverable premises; to proceed by means of puns, metaphors, and ambiguities; and to resemble in their literary style glue thickened with sawdust’ (Broad, 1933, ii). In contrast, Broad says of McTaggart that he ‘was an extremely careful and conscientious writer... [to] be ranked with Hobbes, Berkeley and Hume among the masters of English philosophical prose... [his] style is pellucidly clear’ (Broad, 1927, 308).

Not only did McTaggart enjoy close relationships with the new realists, they shared some basic philosophic tenets. For example, McTaggart and the new realists reject the Bradleyian claim that reality and truth come in degrees. McTaggart argues that there is a ‘confusion’ which leads philosophers to move from one to the other (McTaggart, 1921, 4). McTaggart also rejects the coherence theory of truth espoused by British idealists such as Joachim (and, arguably, Bradley) in favour of the correspondence theory of truth (McTaggart, 1921, 10).

3. Philosophical Writings

a. Hegel

While many of the British idealists studied Hegel, few entered into the murky waters of Hegel scholarship. McTaggart is an exception: Hegel scholarship occupied McTaggart for most of his career. Hegel is a German idealist and his work is notoriously difficult. While some of the British  idealists understood Hegel to be arguing that reality consists of a single partless spiritual being known as the Absolute, McTaggart took Hegel to be arguing for personal idealism.

Hegel is discussed in McTaggart’s very first publication, “The Further Determination of the Absolute” (1893). McTaggart argues that the progress of any idealistic philosophy may be divided into three stages: the proof that reality is not exclusively matter, the proof that reality is exclusively spirit and determining the fundamental nature of that spirit. McTaggart describes Hegel’s understanding of the fundamental nature of spirit as follows. ‘Spirit is ultimately made up of various finite individuals, each of which finds his character and individuality by relating himself to the rest, and by perceiving that they are of the same nature as himself’. The individuals that make up spirit are interdependent, united by a pattern or design akin to an organic unity. McTaggart adds that justifying this ‘would be a task beyond the limits of this paper... it could only be done by going over the whole course of Hegel’s Logic’. One way of understanding the rest of McTaggart’s career is to see that he is making good on his threat to justify Hegel’s understanding of spirit.

Just some of McTaggart’s works on Hegel include Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic (1896), Studies in Hegelian Cosmology (1901) and A Commentary on Hegel’s Logic (1910). A central theme in these books is the question of how the universe, as unified spirit, is differentiated into finite spirits ─ how can a unity also be a plurality? McTaggart takes Hegel to have solved this problem by postulating a unity which is not only in the individuals, but also for the individuals, in that reality is a system of conscious individuals wherein each individual reflects the whole: ‘If we take all reality, for the sake of convenience, as limited to three individuals, A, B, and C, and suppose them to be conscious, then the whole will be reproduced in each of them... [A will] be aware of himself, of B, and of C, and of the unity which joins them in a system’ (McTaggart, 1901, 14). Later, this is exactly the position that McTaggart himself advances. McTaggart also discusses Hegel’s dialectic method at length; this is the process whereby opposition between a thesis and an anti-thesis is resolved into a synthesis. For example, ‘being’ and ‘not being’ are resolved into ‘becoming’. Despite his admiration for this method, McTaggart does not use it in his Nature of Existence; instead of proceeding by dialectic, his argument proceeds via the more familiar method of principles and premises.

There is disagreement within contemporary Hegel scholarship as to how correct McTaggart’s reading of Hegel is. Stern argues that McTaggart’s reading of Hegel bears close similarities to contemporary readings, and that it should be seen as an important precursor (Stern, 2009, 121). In contrast, in his introduction to Some Dogmas of Religion, Broad argues that ‘if McTaggart’s account of Hegelianism be taken as a whole and compared with Hegel’s writings as a whole, the impression produced is one of profound unlikeness’. Similarly, Geach compares McTaggart’s acquaintance with Hegel’s writings to the chapter-and-verse knowledge of the Bible that out-of-the-way Protestant sectarians often have; he adds that the ‘unanimous judgement’ of Hegel scholars appears to be that McTaggart’s interpretations of Hegel were as perverse as these sectarians’ interpretations of the Bible (Geach, 1979, 17).

b. Some Dogmas of Religion

Some Dogmas of Religion (1906) is an exception to McTaggart’s main body of work, in that it assumes no knowledge of philosophy and is intended for general audience. The book covers a large number of topics, from the compatibility of God’s attributes to human freewill. This section picks out three of the book’s central themes: the role of metaphysics, McTaggart’s brand of atheism and the immortality of the soul.

McTaggart defines metaphysics as ‘the systematic study of the ultimate nature of reality’. A dogma is ‘any proposition which has a metaphysical significance’, such as belief in God (McTaggart, 1906, 1). McTaggart argues that dogmas can only be produced by reason ─ by engaging in metaphysics. Science does not produce dogmas, for scientific claims do not aim to express the fundamental nature of reality. For example, science tells us about the laws governing the part of the universe know as ‘matter’ are mechanical. Science does not go on to tell us whether these laws are manifestations of deeper laws, or the will of God (McTaggart, 1906, 13-4). In fact, McTaggart argues that the consistency of science would be unaffected if its object of study ─ matter ─ turned out to be immaterial. To learn about the ultimate nature of the world, we must look to metaphysics, not science.

McTaggart embodies two apparently contradictory characteristics: he is religious and an atheist. The apparent contradiction is resolved by McTaggart’s definition of religion. ‘Religion is clearly a state of mind... an emotion resting on a conviction of a harmony between ourselves and the universe at large’ (McTaggart, 1906, 3). McTaggart aims to define religion as broadly as possible, so as to include the traditional systems ─ such as those of the Greeks, Roman Christians, Judaism and Buddhism ─ and the idiosyncratic ones espoused by philosophers like Spinoza and Hegel. Given this very broad definition of religion, McTaggart’s own system of personal idealism qualifies as religious. However, McTaggart is an atheist, for he denies the existence of God. In Some Dogmas of Religion McTaggart does not argue for atheism, he merely rejects some of the traditional arguments for theism. He defines God as ‘a being that is personal, supreme and good’ (McTaggart, 1906, 186) and argues that theistic arguments do not prove the existence of such a being. For example, the cosmological ‘first cause’ argument claims that if every event must have a cause, including the universe’s very first event, then the first cause must being a which is uncaused: God. McTaggart argues that even if this argument is valid, it does not prove the existence of God, for it does not prove that the first existing being is either personal or good (McTaggart, 1906, 190-1). In The Nature of Existence, McTaggart goes even further than this and argues directly for atheism (McTaggart, 1927, 176-89).

Given that McTaggart denies the reality of time and the existence of God, it may seem strange that he also affirms the immortality of the human soul. However, McTaggart held all three of these claims throughout his life. In Some Dogmas of Religion, McTaggart takes the immortality of the soul as a postulate, and considers objections to it, such as the claim that the soul or self is an activity of the finite human body, or that it cannot exist without it. McTaggart argues that none of these objections are successful. For example, concerning the claim that the self is of such a nature that it cannot exist outside of its present body, McTaggart argues that while we have no evidence of disembodied selves, this shows at most that the self needs some body, not that it needs the body it currently has (McTaggart, 1906, 104-5). McTaggart concludes that the immortality of the soul is at least a real possibility, for souls can move from body to body. He argues that souls are immortal, not in the sense of existing at every time ─ for time does not exist ─ but in the sense that we enjoy a succession of lives, before and after this one. McTaggart calls this the doctrine of the ‘plurality of lives’ (McTaggart, 1906, 116). He goes on to argue that our journey throughout these lives is not guided by chance or mechanical necessity, but rather by the interests of spirit: love, which ‘would have its way’. For example, our proximity to our loved ones is not the product of chance or mechanical arrangement, but is rather caused by the fact that our spirits are more closely connected to these selves than to others. This accounts for phenomena such as ‘love at first sight’: we have loved these people before, in previous lives (McTaggart, 1906, 134-5). In The Nature of Existence, McTaggart puts forward a positive argument for the immortality of the soul and continues to emphasise that love is of the utmost importance. By affirming the immortality of the soul, McTaggart seems to take himself to be following Spinoza in making death ‘the least of all things’ (McTaggart, 1906, 299).

c. The Unreality of Time

McTaggart’s paper “The Unreality of Time” (1908) presents the argument he is best known for. (The argument of this paper is also included in the second volume of The Nature of Existence.) McTaggart argues that the belief in the unreality of time has proved ‘singularly attractive’ throughout the ages, and attributes such belief to Spinoza, Kant, Hegel and Bradley. (In the case of Spinoza, this attribution is arguable; Spinoza describes time as a general character of existents, albeit one conceived using the imagination.) McTaggart offers us a wholly new argument in favour of this belief, and here is its outline.

McTaggart distinguishes two ways of ordering events or ‘positions’ in time: the A series takes some position as present, and orders other positions as running from the past to the present and from the present to the future; meanwhile the B series orders events in virtue of whether they are earlier or later than other events. The argument itself has two steps. In the first step, McTaggart aims to show that there is no time without the A series because only the A series can account for change. On the B series nothing changes, any event N has ─ and will always have ─ the same position in the time series: ‘If N is ever earlier than O and later then M, it will always be, and has always been... since the relations of earlier and later are permanent’. In contrast, change does occur on the A series. For example an event, such as the death of Queen Anne, began by being a future event, became present and then became past. Real change only occurs on the A series when events move from being in the future, to being in the present, to being in the past.

In the second step, McTaggart argues that the A series cannot exist, and hence time cannot exist. He does so by attempting to show that the existence of the A series would generate contradiction because past, present and future are incompatible attributes; if an event M has the attribute of being present it cannot also be in the past and the future. However, McTaggart maintains that ‘every event has them all’ ─ for example, if M is past, then it has been present and future ─ which is inconsistent with change. As the application of the A series to reality involves a contradiction, the A series cannot be true of reality. This does not entail that our perceptions are false; on the contrary, McTaggart maintains that it is possible that the realities which we perceive as events in a time series do really form a non-temporal C series. Although this C series would not admit of time or change, it does admit of order. For example, if we perceive two events M and N as occurring at the same time, it may be that ─ while time does not exist ─ M and N have the same position in the ordering of the C series. McTaggart attributes this view of time to Hegel, claiming that Hegel regards the time series as a distorted reflexion of something in the real nature of the timeless reality. In “The Unreality of Time”, McTaggart does not consider at length what the C series is; he merely suggests that the positions within it may be ultimate facts or that they are determined by varying quantities within objects. In “The Relation of Mind to Eternity” (1909) ─ reprinted in his Philosophical Studies ─ McTaggart goes further than this. He compares our perception of time to viewing reality through a tinted glass, and suggests that the C series is an ordering of representations of reality according to how accurate they are. Our ersatz temporal perception that we are moving through time reflects our movement towards the end point of this series, which is the correct perception of reality. This end point will involve the fact that reality is really timeless, so time is understood as the process by which we reach the timeless. Later still, in the second volume of The Nature of Existence, McTaggart reconsiders this position and argues that while the objects of the C series are representations of reality, they are not ordered by veracity. Instead, McTaggart argues that the ‘fundamental sense’ of the C series is that it is ordered according to the ‘amount of content of the whole that is included in it’: it runs from the less inclusive to the more inclusive (McTaggart, 1927, 362). However, McTaggart does not give up his claim that the C series will reach a timeless end point. For more on this, see The Nature of Existence (1927), chapters 59-61.

Reception to “The Unreality of Time” among McTaggart’s contemporaries was mixed. Ewing describes its implausible conclusion as ‘heroic’, while Broad describes it ‘as an absolute howler’. This argument is probably the most influential piece of philosophy that McTaggart ever produced. Although the paper’s conclusions are rarely endorsed in full, it is credited with providing the framework for a debate ─ between the A and B series of time ─ which is still alive today.  For discussion, see Dummett “A Defence of McTaggart’s Proof of the Unreality of Time” (1960),  Lowe “The Indexical Fallacy in McTaggart's Proof of the Unreality of Time” (1987) and Le Poidevin & Mellor “Time, Change, and the ' Indexical Fallacy'” (1987). For an extended, more recent discussion, see Dainton (2001).

d. The Nature of Existence

McTaggart’s magnum opus aims to provide a comprehensive, systematic a priori description of the world; the conclusion of this system is personal idealism. Broad claims that The Nature of Existence may quite fairly be ranked with the Enneads of Plotinus, the Ethics of Spinoza, and the Encyclopaedia of Hegel (Broad, 1927). The central argument of The Nature of Existence is based on the nature of substance and it is extremely complex. The bare bones of the argument contains three steps but along the way, McTaggart makes use of a number of subsidiary arguments.

In the first step, McTaggart argues that the universe contains multiple substances. McTaggart defines a substance as whatever exists and has qualities, or stands in relations, but is not itself a quality or relation, entailing that the following are all substances: sneezes, parties and red-haired archdeacons (McTaggart, 1921, 73). Given this broad definition, McTaggart argues that at least one substance exists; this is true given the evidence of our senses, and that there is anything around to consider the statement at all. All substances have qualities (today, we would say ‘properties’) such as redness and squareness. If there are multiple substances, then relations hold between them. Although to contemporary philosophers the claim that relations are real is familiar, in the context of British Idealism this is a significant departure from Bradley’s claim that relations are unreal. The qualities and relations possessed by a substance are jointly called its characteristics. McTaggart puts forward two kinds of arguments for the claim that there are multiple substances. Firstly, there are empirical proofs, such as the claim that if I and the things I perceive exist, then there are at least two substances (McTaggart, 1921, 75). Secondly, as we will see below, McTaggart argues that all substances can be differentiated into further substances. If this is true then it follows that if at least one substance exists, many exist.

In the second step, McTaggart places two necessary ontological conditions on the nature of substances ─ they must admit of sufficient descriptions, and they must be differentiated into further substances ─ which results in his theory of determining correspondence.

The first ontological condition McTaggart places on substance is that they must admit of sufficient descriptions. This grows out of McTaggart’s extended discussion of the ‘Dissimilarity of the Diverse’ ─ see Chapter 10 of the first volume of the Nature of Existence ─ which argues that diverse (that is, non-identical) things are dissimilar, that two things cannot have the same nature. This ‘similarity’ involves the properties and relations a substance has. For example, McTaggart argues that if space is absolute then two things will occupy different spatial positions and stand in dissimilar spatial relations. McTaggart discusses the relationship between his principle the ‘Dissimilarity of the Diverse’, and Leibniz’s principle the ‘Identity of Indiscernibles’, which states that two things are identical if they are indiscernible. McTaggart prefers the name of his principle, for it does not suggest that there are indiscernibles which are identical but rather that there is nothing which is indiscernible from anything else. McTaggart goes on to argue that all substances admit of an ‘exclusive description’ which applies only to them via a description of their qualities. For example, the description ‘The continent lying over the South Pole’ applies to just one substance. All substances admit of exclusive descriptions because, given the Dissimilarity of the Diverse, no substance can have exactly the same nature as any other (McTaggart, 1921, 106). There are two kinds of exclusive descriptions: firstly, the kind that introduce another substance into the description, such as ‘The father of Henry VIII’; secondly, the kind known as ‘sufficient descriptions’, which describe a substance purely in terms of its qualities, without introducing another substance into the description, such as ‘The father of a monarch’. McTaggart argues that all substances must admit of sufficient descriptions: all substances are dissimilar to all other substances and as a result they admit of exclusive descriptions. If a substance could not be described without making reference to other substances then we would arrive at an infinite regress (because, as we will see, all substances are differentiated to infinity) and the description would correspondingly be infinite (McTaggart, 1921, 108). Such a regress would be vicious because it would never be completed. As substances do exist, they must admit of sufficient descriptions.

The second ontological condition placed on substances is that they are infinitely differentiated into proper parts which are also substances. By ‘differentiated,’ McTaggart implies that they are divisible and that they are divisible into parts unlike their wholes. To illustrate, a homogeneous ─ that is, uniform ─ liquid akin to milk might be infinitely divisible, but all of its parts would be like their wholes, they would merely be smaller portions of milk. In contrast, a heterogeneous ─ that is, non-uniform ─ liquid akin to a fruit smoothie would be infinitely divisible into parts that are unlike their whole: the whole might contain cherry and orange, while its parts contain pieces of cherry and orange respectively. McTaggart argues that all substances are infinitely differentiated by denying a priori that ‘simple’ partless substances are possible; he does so in two ways. The first way is based on divisibility. Simples would have to be indivisible in every dimension ─ in length, breadth and time ─ and this is impossible because even a substance like ‘pleasure’ has two dimensions, if it lasts for at least two moments of time (McTaggart, 1921, 175). The second way is based on notion of content. A simple substance would be a substance without ‘content’ in that it would lack properties and would not stand in relations. McTaggart argues that it is part of our notion of a substance that they must have a ‘filling’ of some sort ─  an ‘internal structure’ ─ and this could only be understood to mean that they must have parts (McTaggart, 1921, 181). Both of these arguments are somewhat hazy; see Broad (1933) for an extensive discussion and critique.

McTaggart’s full account of parts and wholes ─ which discusses divisibility, simples and composition ─ can be found in the first volume of The Nature of Existence, chapters 15-22. McTaggart endorses the doctrine of unrestricted composition, whereby any two substances compose a further compound substance. It follows from this that the universe or ‘all that exists’ is a single substance composed of all other substances (McTaggart, 1921, 78). While we might doubt the existence of simples (that is, partless atoms) we cannot doubt the existence of the universe because it includes all content (McTaggart, 1921, 172). Given McTaggart’s claim that all substances are differentiated and that unrestricted composition occurs, it follows that all parts and all collections of substances are themselves substances. These dual claims have made their way into an argument within contemporary metaphysics by Jonathan Schaffer. In contemporary parlance, anything that is infinitely divisible into proper parts which also have proper parts is ‘gunky’. One way of understanding McTaggart is to see that he claiming that, while all substances lack a ‘lower’ level ─ because they are gunky, infinitely divisible into further parts ─ all substances have a ‘highest’ level in the form of the universe, a substance which includes all content. Schaffer makes use of this asymmetry of existence ─ the fact that one can seriously doubt the existence of simples but not the existence of the universe as a whole ─ to argue for priority monism (Schaffer, 2010, 61).

With these two ontological conditions in place ─ that substances must admit of sufficient descriptions and be differentiated ─ McTaggart sets out to combine them into his theory of determining correspondence. This theory is extremely difficult and rather obscure; see Wisdom (1928) and Broad (1933). Essentially, McTaggart argues that the two ontological conditions result in contradiction unless substances fulfil a certain requirement. The worry is that a substance A cannot be given a sufficient description in virtue of sufficient descriptions of its parts M, for they can only be described in virtue of a sufficient descriptions of their parts... and so on to infinity. This is a vicious series because the sufficient descriptions of the members of M can only be made sufficient by means of the last stage of an unending series; in other words, they cannot be made sufficient at all (McTaggart, 1921, 199). Of course, as there are substances, they must admit of sufficient descriptions. McTaggart’s way out of this apparent contradiction seems to be to reverse the direction of epistemological priority: we have been considering deducing a sufficient description of a substance in virtue of its parts; instead, we should be deducing sufficient descriptions of the parts in virtue of the substance of which they are a whole. ‘[If] the contradiction is to be avoided, there must be some description of every substance which does imply sufficient descriptions of every part through all its infinite series of sets of parts’ (McTaggart, 1921, 204). The only way to provide such a description is via the law of determining correspondence, which asserts that each part of A is in a one-to-one correspondence with each term of its infinite series, the nature of the correspondence being such that, in the fact that a part of A corresponded in this way to a reality with a given nature, there would be implied a sufficient description of that part of A. The theory of determining correspondence involves a classification of the contents of the universe. The universe is a primary whole and it divides into primary parts, whose sufficient descriptions determine ─ by virtue of the relation of determining correspondence ─ the sufficient description of all further, secondary parts.

In the third step of his argument, McTaggart shows that the only way the nature of substance could comply with the theory of determining correspondence is if substance is spirit. He does this by eliminating the other candidates for the nature of substance, matter and sense data. His objections to both of these rival candidates are similar; we will focus on his rejection of matter. McTaggart argues that while there ‘might’ be no difficulty in the claim that matter is infinitely divisible, there is certainly is difficulty in the claim that matter can allow for determining correspondence (McTaggart, 1927, 33). This is impossible because, in a material object, the sufficient description of the parts determines the sufficient description of the whole, not the other way around. ‘If we know the shape and size of each one of a set of parts of A, and their position relatively to each other, we know the size and shape of A... we shall thus have an infinite series of terms, in which the subsequent terms imply the precedent’ (McTaggart, 1927, 36). As we have already seen above, such a series will involve a contradiction, for the description will never ‘bottom out’. One way out of this contradiction might be to postulate that, at each level of composition, the parts bear a ‘new’ property ─ such as a new colour or taste ─ which would be sufficient to describe them. McTaggart swiftly dispenses with this reply by arguing that it would require matter to possess an infinite number of sorts of qualities ─ ‘one sort for each of the infinite series of grades of secondary parts’ ─ and there is no reason to suppose that matter possesses more than the very limited number of qualities that are currently known to us (McTaggart, 1927, 35). McTaggart briefly considers dividing matter to infinity in time but dismisses the idea because of course, for McTaggart, time is unreal. McTaggart concludes that matter cannot exist. Interestingly, he does not take this conclusion to imply anti-realism about science or common sense, for when those disciplines use terms which assume the existence of matter, what is meant by those terms ‘remains just as true’ if we take the view that matter does not exist (McTaggart, 1927, 53).

Having dispensed with its rivals, McTaggart turns to idealism. Spiritual substances include selves, their parts, and compounds of multiple selves. Idealism is compatible with the theory of determining correspondence when the primary parts of the universe are understood to be selves, and the secondary parts their perceptions which are differentiated to infinity (McTaggart, 1927, 89).   While this does not amount to a positive proof of idealism, it gives us good reason to believe that nothing but spirit exists, for there is no other option on the table (McTaggart, 1927, 115). McTaggart also describes how the universe is a ‘self-reflecting unity’, in that the parts of the universe reflect every other part (McTaggart, 1921, 299). As we saw above, this is the view that McTaggart attributed to Hegel. McTaggart’s system also bears some similarity to the monadism advanced in Leibniz’s Monadology, wherein each monad is a spirit that reflects every other monad. Furthermore, in Leibniz’s system the highest ranks of monads are capable of entering into a community with God of pure love. Similarly, in McTaggart’s system (although there is no divine monarch) the souls are bound together by the purest form of love which results in the purest form of happiness (McTaggart, 1927, 156). These arguments are but developments of principles that McTaggart had espoused his entire life.

This section merely describes the main thread of argument in The Nature of Existence; the work itself covers many more topics. These include the notion of organic unity, the nature of cogitation, volition, emotion, good and evil, and error. Further topics are also covered in McTaggart’s Philosophical Studies, such the nature of causality and the role of philosophy as opposed to science.

4. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • (1893) “The Further Determination of the Absolute”. Pamphlet designed for private distribution only. Reprinted in McTaggart’s Philosophical Studies.
  • (1896) “Time and the Hegelian Dialectic”. Mind Vol. 2, 490–504.
  • (1896) Studies in the Hegelian Dialectic. CUP: GB.
  • (1897) “Hegel's Treatment of the Categories of the Subjective Notion”. Mind Vol. 6, 342–358.
  • (1899) “Hegel's Treatment of the Categories of the Objective Notion”. Mind Vol. 8, 35–62.
  • (1900) “Hegel's Treatment of the Categories of the Idea”. Mind Vol. 9, 145–183.
  • (1901) Studies in Hegelian Cosmology. CUP: Glasgow.
  • (1906) Some Dogmas of Religion. Edward Arnold press: GB.
  • (1908) “The Unreality of Time”. Mind Vol. 17, 457–474.
  • (1909) “The Relation of Time to Eternity” Mind Vol. 18, 343-362.
  • (1910) A Commentary on Hegel's Logic. CUP: GB.
  • (1916) Human Immortality and Pre-Existence. Edward Arnold Press: GB.
  • (1921) The Nature of Existence I. CUP: London.
  • (1927)The Nature of Existence II. Edited by C. D. Broad. CUP: London.
  • (1934) Philosophical Studies. Edited by S.V. Keeling. Theomes Press: England.
    • [A large collection of McTaggart’s papers]

b. Selected Secondary Sources

  • Baldwin, Thomas (1990). G. E. Moore. Routledge: UK.
    • [Describes the relationship between Moore and McTaggart]
  • Bradley, F. (1920). Appearance and Reality. George Allen & Unwin Ltd: GB
    • [Bradley is the arch British idealist]
  • Broad, C. D. (1927). “John McTaggart Ellis McTaggart 1866-1925”, Proceedings of the British Academy Vol. XIII, 307-334.
  • Broad, C.D. (1933) An Examination of McTaggart's Philosophy. CUP: GB
  • Dainton, Barry (2001). Time and Space. Acumen Publishing Ltd: GB.
    • [Provides an excellent discussion of McTaggart’s argument on the unreality of time]
  • Dickinson, G. Lowes (1931). J. M. E. McTaggart. CUP: GB.
  • Geach, Peter (1979). Truth, Love and Immortality: an Introduction to McTaggart's Philosophy. University of California Press: GB.
  • Moore, G.E. (1925). “Death of Dr. McTaggart”, Mind Vol. 34, 269–271.
  • Moore, G.E. (1942). “An Autobiography”, in The Philosophy of G.E. Moore. Tudor Publishing Company: GB.
  • Russell, Bertrand (1998). The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell. Routledge: GB.
  • Schaffer, Jonathan (2010). “Monism: The Priority of the Whole”, Philosophical Review, Vol. 119, pp. 31-76.
    • [Utilises McTaggart’s asymmetry of existence – between the non-existence of simples and the existence of the universe as a whole – in a new way]
  • Stern, Robert (2009). Hegelian Metaphysics. OUP: GB.
    • [Gives an excellent history of the movement, and discusses how close McTaggart’s interpretation of Hegel is to Hegel himself]
  • Wisdom, John. 1928. “McTaggart's Determining Correspondence of Substance: a Refutation”, Mind Vol. 37, 414–438.


Author Information

Emily Thomas
University of Cambridge
United Kingdom

Aquinas: Metaphysics

aquinasMetaphysics is taken by Thomas Aquinas to be the study of being qua being, that is, a study of the most fundamental aspects of being that constitute a being and without which it could not be. Aquinas’s metaphysical thought follows a modified but general Aristotelian view. Primarily, for Aquinas, a thing cannot be unless it possesses an act of being, and the thing that possesses an act of being is thereby rendered an essence/existence composite. If an essence has an act of being, the act of being is limited by that essence whose act it is. The essence in itself is the definition of a thing; and the paradigm instances of essence/existence composites are material substances (though not all substances are material for Aquinas; for example, God is not). A material substance (say, a cat or a tree) is a composite of matter and form, and it is this composite of matter and form that is primarily said to exist. In other words, the matter/form composite is predicated neither of, nor in, anything else and is the primary referent of being; all other things are said of it. The details of this very rich metaphysical landscape are described below.

Table of Contents

  1. The Nature of Metaphysics
  2. Essence and Existence
  3. Participation
  4. Substance and Accident
  5. Matter and Form
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. General Studies

1. The Nature of Metaphysics

Saint Thomas, that is, Aquinas, clarifies the nature of metaphysics through ascertaining its particular subject-matter, its field of investigation. In order to ascertain the subject-matter of any particular science, Thomas distinguishes between the different intellectual operations that we use when engaged in some particular scientific endeavor. Broadly speaking, these fall into two categories: the speculative and the practical. Concerning some sciences, the intellect is merely speculative  by contemplating the truth of some particular subject-matter; while concerning other sciences, the intellect is practical, by  ascertaining the truth and seeking to apply. There are thus correspondingly two distinct classes of science: speculative science and practical science. Speculative sciences are those that contemplate truth whereas practical sciences are those that apply truth for some practical purpose. The sciences are then further distinguished through differentiating their various subject-matters.

Insofar as the speculative sciences merely contemplate truth but do not apply it for some practical purpose, the subject-matter of the speculative sciences is that which can be understood to some extent. Working within the Aristotelian tradition, Thomas holds that something is understood when it is separated from matter and is necessary to thing in some respect. For instance, when we understand the nature of a tree, what we understand is not primarily the matter that goes to constitute the tree in question, but what it is to be a tree, or the structuring principle of the matter that so organizes it and specifies it as a tree rather than a plant. Furthermore, assuming our understanding is correct, when we understand a thing to be a tree, we do not understand it to be a dog, or a horse, or a cat. Thus, in our understanding of a tree, we understand that which is necessary for the tree to be a tree, and not of anything that is not a tree. Hence, our understanding of a thing is separated from its matter and is necessary to it in some respect. Now, what is in motion is not necessary, since what is in motion can change. Thus, the degree to which we have understood something is conditional upon the degree to which it is separated from matter and motion. It follows then that speculative objects, the subject-matter of the speculative-sciences, insofar as they are what are understood, will be separated from matter and motion to some degree. Any distinctions that obtain amongst speculative objects will in turn signify distinctions amongst the sciences that consider those objects; and we can find distinctions amongst speculative objects based upon their disposition towards matter and motion.

There are three divisions that can apply to speculative objects, thereby permitting us to differentiate the sciences that consider such objects: (i) there is a class of speculative objects that are dependent on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood, for instance, human beings cannot be without matter, and they cannot be understood without their constituent matter (flesh and bones); (ii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion for their being, but not for their being understood, for instance, we can understand lines, numbers, and points without thereby understanding the matter in which they are found, yet such things cannot be without matter; (iii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood.

Given these three classes of speculative objects, the speculative sciences that consider them can be enumerated accordingly: (i) physical science considers those things that depend on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood; (ii) mathematics considers those things that depend on matter and motion for their being but not for their being understood; (iii) metaphysics or theology deals with those things that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Before going on to consider the subject-matter of metaphysics in a little more detail, it is important to point out that Thomas takes this division of the speculative sciences as exhaustive. For Thomas, there could be no fourth speculative science; the reason for this is that the subject-matter of such a science would have to be those things that depend on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being, for all other combinations have been exhausted. Now, if a thing depends on matter and motion for its being understood but not for its being, then matter and motion would be put into its definition, which defines a thing as it exists. But if a thing’s existence is so defined as to include matter and motion, then it follows that it depends on matter and motion for its being; for it cannot be understood to be without matter and motion. Hence, all things that include matter and motion in their definitions are dependent on matter and motion for their being, but not all things that depend on matter and motion for their being depend on matter and motion for their being understood. There could be no fourth speculative science since there is no fourth class of speculative objects depending on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being. Thomas thus sees this threefold division of the speculative sciences as an exhaustive one.

The third class of speculative objects comprises the objects of metaphysics or theology. Now Thomas does not equate these two disciplines, but goes on to distinguish between the proper subject-matter of metaphysics and the proper subject-matter of theology. Recall that this third class of speculative objects comprises those things depending on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Such things are thus immaterial things; however, Thomas here draws a distinction. There are things that are immaterial insofar as they are in themselves complete immaterial substances; God and the angels would be examples of such things. To give the latter a title, let them be called positively immaterial. On the other hand there are things that are immaterial insofar as they simply do not depend on matter and motion, but can nevertheless be sometimes said to be found therein. In other words, things of the latter category are neutral with respect to being found in matter and motion, and hence they are neutrally immaterial. St Thomas’s examples of the latter are: being, substance, potency, form, act, one and many; such things can apply equally to material things (such as humans, dogs, cats, mice) and, to some extent, to positively immaterial things. Thus, the neutrally immaterial seem to signify certain aspects or modes of being that can apply equally to material and to immaterial things. The question then arises: what is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics: the positively immaterial or the neutrally immaterial?

According to Thomas, unaided human reason cannot have direct knowledge of the positively immaterial; this is because such things (God and angels) outstrip the human intellect’s capacity to know. Nevertheless, direct knowledge of the positively immaterial is possible, but this will not be on the basis of unaided human reason; it will require that the positively immaterial reveal themselves to us in some way, in which case direct knowledge of the positively immaterial will be dependent on some sort of revelation. As it is a purely rational science, not dependent on or presupposing the truths of revelation, metaphysics will be a study of the neutrally immaterial aspects of things, that is, a study of those modes of being that apply to all beings, whether they are material or immaterial. Such a study will be in accord with the Aristotelian conception of metaphysics as a study of being qua being, insofar as the neutrally immaterial apply to all beings and are not restricted to a certain class of beings. However, Thomas does not adopt the Aristotelian phrase (being qua being) as the subject-matter of metaphysics, he offers his own term. According to Thomas, ens commune (common being) is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics. Through an investigation of ens commune, an investigation into the aspects of being common to all beings, the metaphysician may indeed come to a knowledge of the causes of being and might thereby be led to the affirmation of divine being, but this is only at the end of the metaphysical inquiry, not at the beginning. Thus, metaphysics for Aquinas is a study of ens commune where this is understood as the common aspects of being without which a thing could not be; it does not presuppose the existence of divine being, and may not even be led to an affirmation of divine being (though Thomas of course offers several highly complex metaphysical arguments for the existence of divine being, but this should not be taken to be essential to the starting point of Thomistic metaphysics).

Metaphysics then is a study of the certain aspects common to all beings; and it is the task of the metaphysician to uncover the aspects of being that are indeed common and without which a thing could not be. There are certain aspects of being that are common insofar as they are generally applicable to all beings, and these are essence and existence; all beings exist and have an essence, hence metaphysics will be primarily concerned with the nature of essence and existence and their relationship to each other. Having completed an investigation into essence and existence, the metaphysician must investigate the aspects of being that are common to particular instances of being; and this will be a study of (i) the composition of substance and accident, and (ii) the composition of matter and form. The format of Thomistic metaphysics then takes a somewhat dyadic structure of descending generality: (i) essence and existence, (ii) substance and accident, (iii) matter and form. The format of the remainder of this article will be an investigation into these dyadic structures.

2. Essence and Existence


A general notion of essence is the following: essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. Quite generally then, the essence of a thing is signified by its definition. The immediate question then is how the essence of a thing relates to its existence. In finite entities, essence is that which has existence, but it is not existence; this is a crude articulation of Thomas’s most fundamental metaphysical teaching: that essence and existence are distinct in finite entities. A consideration then of essence and existence in Thomas’s metaphysical thought will thus be a consideration of his fundamental teaching that essence and existence are distinct.

The most famous, and to a certain degree the most controversial, instance wherein Thomas argues for a distinction between a thing’s essence and its existence is in De Ente et Essentia [On Being and Essence] Chapter Four. The context is a discussion of immaterial substances and whether or not they are composed of matter. In that passage, Thomas is concerned with a popular medieval discussion known as universal hylemorphism. St Bonaventure, Thomas’s contemporary, had held that insofar as creatures are in potency in some respect, they must be material in some respect, since on the Aristotelian account, matter is the principle of potency in a thing. Thus, creatures, even immaterial creatures, must be material in some respect, even if this materiality is nothing like our corporeal materiality. Thomas takes up this issue in De Ente Chapter 4, pointing out that the Jewish thinker Avicebron seems to have been the author of this position.

Thomas takes the notion of universal hylemorphism to be absurd. Not only does it conflict with the common sayings of the philosophers, but also it is precisely as separated from matter and all material conditions that we deem separate (immaterial) substances separate, in which case they cannot be composed of matter. But if such substances cannot be composed of matter, what accounts for their potentiality? Such substances are not God, they are not pure act, they are in potentiality in some respect. So, if they are not material, then how are they in potency? Thomas is thus led to hold that they have an element of potentiality, but this is not the potency supplied by matter; rather, immaterial substances are composed of essence and existence, and it is the essence of the thing, standing in potency to a distinct act of existence, that accounts for the potentiality of creatures and thereby distinguishes them from God, who is not so composed. Thomas’s argumentation for the distinction between essence and existence unfolds on three stages and for each stage there has been at least one commentator who has held that Thomas both intended and established the real distinction therein.

In the first stage Thomas argues as follows. Whatever does not enter into the understanding of any essence is composed with that essence from without; for we cannot understand an essence without understanding the parts of that essence. But we can understand the essence of something without knowing anything about its existence; for instance, one can understand the essence of a man or a phoenix without thereby understanding the existence of either. Hence, essence and existence are distinct.

This little paragraph has generated considerable controversy, insofar as it is unclear what sort of distinction Thomas intends to establish at this stage. Is it merely a logical distinction whereby it is one thing to understand the essence of a thing and another to understand its existence? On this account, essence and existence could well be identical in the thing yet distinct in our understanding thereof (just as ‘Morning star’ and ‘Evening star’ are distinct in our conceptual expressions of the planet Venus, yet both are identical with Venus). On the other hand, does Thomas attempt to establish a real distinction whereby essence and existence are not only distinct in our understanding, but also in the thing itself? Commentators who hold that this stage only establishes a logical distinction focus on the fact that Thomas is here concerned only with our understanding of essence and not with actual (real) things; such commentators include Joseph Owens and John Wippel. Commentators who hold that this stage establishes a real distinction focus on the distinction between the act of understanding a thing’s essence and the act of knowing its existence, and they argue that a distinction in cognitional acts points to a distinction in reality; such commentators include Walter Patt, Anthony Kenny, and Steven Long.

In the second stage of argumentation, Thomas claims that if there were a being whose essence is its existence, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence would differ. This is clear when we consider how things can be multiplied. A thing can be multiplied in one of three ways: (i) as a genus is multiplied into its species through the addition of some difference, for instance the genus ‘animal’ is multiplied into the species ‘human’ through the addition of ‘rational’; (ii) as a species is multiplied into its individuals through being composed with matter, for instance the species ‘human’ is multiplied into various humans through being received in diverse clumps of matter; (iii) as a thing is absolute and shared in by many particular things, for instance if there were some absolute fire from which all other fires were derived. Thomas claims that a being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied in either of the first two ways (he does not consider the third way, presumably because in that case the thing that is received or participated in is not itself multiplied; the individuals are multiplied and they simply share in some single absolute reality). A being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied (i) through the addition of some difference, for then its essence would not be its existence but its existence plus some difference, nor could it be multiplied (ii) through being received in matter, for then it would not be subsistent, but it must be subsistent if it exists in virtue of what it is. Overall then, if there were a being whose essence is its existence, it would be unique, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence are distinct.

Notice that Thomas has once again concluded that essence and existence are distinct. John Wippel takes this to be the decisive stage in establishing that essence and existence are really distinct. He argues that insofar as it is impossible for there to be more than one being whose essence is its existence, there could not be in reality many such beings, in which case if we grant that there are multiple beings in reality, such beings are composed of essence and existence. On the other hand, Joseph Owens has charged Wippel with an ontological move and claims that Wippel is arguing from some positive conceptual content, to the actuality of that content in reality. Owens argues that we cannot establish the real distinction until we have established that there is something whose essence is its existence. Given the existence of a being whose essence is its existence, we can contrast its existence with the existence of finite things, and conclude that the latter are composites of essence and existence; and so Owens sees the real distinction as established at stage three of Thomas’s argumentation: the proof that there actually is a being whose essence is its existence.

Thomas begins stage three with the premise that whatever belongs to a thing belongs to it either through its intrinsic principles,  its essence, or from some extrinsic principle. A thing cannot be the cause of its own existence, for then it would have to precede itself in existence, which is absurd. Everything then whose essence is distinct from its existence must be caused to be by another. Now, what is caused to be by another is led back to what exists in itself (per se). There must be a cause then for the existence of things, and this because it is pure existence (esse tantum); otherwise an infinite regress of causes would ensue.

It is here that Owens believes that Thomas establishes the real distinction; since Thomas establishes (to his own satisfaction) that there exists a being whose essence is its existence. Consequently, we can contrast the existence of such a being with the existence of finite entities and observe that in the latter existence is received as from an efficient cause whereas in the former it is not. Thus, essence and existence are really distinct. However, it is important to note that on this interpretation, the real distinction could not enter into the argument for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence; for, on Owens’s account, such argumentation is taken to establish the real distinction. If it can be shown then that Thomas’s argumentation for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence does presuppose the real distinction, then Owens’s views as to the stage at which the real distinction is established would be considerably undermined.

Having established (at some stage) that essence and existence are distinct and that there exists a being whose essence is its existence, Thomas goes on to conclude that in immaterial substances, essence is related to existence as potency to act. The latter follows insofar as what receives existence stands in potency to the existence that it receives. But all things receive existence from the being whose essence is its existence, in which case the existence that any one finite thing possesses is an act of existence that actuates a corresponding potency: the essence. Thomas has thus shown that immaterial substances do indeed have an element of potency, but this need not be a material potency.

Notice that here Thomas correlates essence and existence as potency and act only after he has concluded to the existence of a being whose essence is its existence (God). One wonders then whether or not essence and existence can be related as potency and act only on the presupposition of the existence of God. Regardless of his preferred method in the De Ente Chapter 4, Thomas could very well have focussed on the efficiently caused character of existence in finite entities (as he does in the opening lines of the argument for the existence of God), and argued that insofar as existence is efficiently caused (whether or not this is from God), existence stands to that in which it inheres as act to potency, in which case the essence that possesses existence stands in potency to that act of existence. Therefore, Thomas need not presuppose the existence of God in order to hold that essence and existence are related as potency and act; all he need presuppose is (i) that essence and existence are distinct and (ii) that existence is efficiently caused in the essence/existence composite.

3. Participation


Essence/existence composites merely have existence; whatever an essence/existence composite is, it is not its existence. Insofar as essence/existence composites merely have, but are not, existence, they participate in existence in order to exist. This is a second of Thomas’s fundamental metaphysical teachings: whatever does not essentially exist, merely participates in existence. Insofar as no essence/existence composite essentially exists, all essence/existence composites merely participate in existence. More specifically, the act of existence that each and every essence/existence composite possesses is participated in by the essence that exists.

As a definition of participation, Thomas claims that to participate is to take a part (in) (partem capere) something. Following this definition, Thomas goes on to explain how one thing can be said to take a part in and thereby participate in another; this can happen in three ways.

Firstly, when something receives in a particular fashion what pertains universally to another, it is said to participate in that other; for example, a species (‘man’) is said to participate in its genus (‘animal’) and an individual (Socrates) is said to participate in its species (‘man’) because they (the species and the individual) do not possess the intelligible structure of that in which they participate according to its full universality.

Secondly, a subject is said to participate in the accidents that it has (for instance, a man is a certain colour, and thereby participates in the colour of which he is), and matter is said to participate in the formal structure that it has (for instance, the matter of a statue participates in the shape of that statue in order to be the statue in question).

Thirdly, an effect can be said to participate in its cause, especially when the effect is not equal to the power of that cause. The effect particularises and determines the scope of the cause; for the effect acts as the determinate recipient of the power of the cause. The effect receives from its cause only that which is necessary for the production of the effect. It is in this way that a cause is participated in by its effect.

In all of the foregoing modes of participation, to participate is to limit that which is participated in some respect. This follows from the original etymological definition of participation, that to participate is to take a part (in); for if to participate is merely to take a part in something, the participant will not possess the nature of the thing in which it participates in any total fashion, but only in partial fashion. What then can we conclude about the participation framework that governs essence and existence?

Essences exist, but they do not exist essentially, they participate in their acts of existence. Insofar as an essence participates in its act of existence, the essence limits that act of existence to the nature of the essence whose act it is; for the essence merely has existence, it is not existence, in which case its possession of existence will be in accord with the nature of the essence. The act of existence is thus limited and thereby individuated to the essence whose act it is. As a concrete application of this, consider the following. George Bush’s existence is not Tony Blair’s existence; when George Bush came into existence, Tony Blair did not come into existence, and when George Bush ceases to exist, Tony Blair will, in all likelihood, not cease to exist. George Bush’s existence is not indexed to the existence of Tony Blair, in which case the existence of either George Bush or Tony Blair is not identical to the other. The act of existence then is individuated to the essence whose act it is, and this because the essence merely participates in, and thereby limits, the act of existence that it possesses.

4. Substance and Accident


The next fundamental metaphysical category is that of substance. According to Aquinas, substances are what are primarily said to exist, and so substances are what have existence but yet are not identical with existence. Aquinas’s ontology then is comprised primarily of substances, and all change is either a change of one substance into another substance, or a modification of an already existing substance. Given that essence is that which is said to possess existence, but is not identical to existence, substances are essence/existence composites; their existence is not guaranteed by what they are. They simply have existence as limited by their essence.

Let us begin with a logical definition of substance, as this will give us an indication of its metaphysical nature. Logically speaking, a substance is what is predicated neither of nor in anything else. This captures the fundamental notion that substances are basic, and everything else is predicated either of or in them. Now, if we transpose this logical definition of substance to the realm of metaphysics, where existence is taken into consideration, we can say that a substance is that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject or as a part of anything else, but what exists in itself. Thus, a substance is a properly basic entity, existing per se (though of course depending on an external cause for its existence), and the paradigm instances of which are the medium sized objects that we see around us: horses, cats, trees and humans.

On the other hand there are accidents. Accidents are what accrue to substances and modify substances in some way. Logically speaking, accidents are predicated of or in some substance; metaphysically speaking, accidents cannot exist in themselves but only as part of some substance. As their name suggests, accidents are incidental to the thing, and they can come and go without the thing losing its identity; whereas a thing cannot cease to be the substance that it is without losing its identity.

Accidents only exist as part of some substance. It follows then that we cannot have un-exemplified properties as if they were substances in themselves. Properties are always exemplified by some substance, whereas substance itself is un-exemplifiable. For example, brown is always predicated of something, we say that x is brown, in which case brown is an accident. However, brown is never found to be in itself, it is always exemplified by something of which it is said.

Within Aquinas’s metaphysical framework, substances can be both material (cats, dogs, humans) and immaterial (angels), but as noted above, the paradigm instances of substances are material substances, and the latter are composites of matter and form; a material substance is neither its matter alone nor its form alone, since matter and form are always said to be of some individual and never in themselves. It follows then that material substances have parts, and the immediate question arises as to whether or not the parts of substances are themselves substances. In order to address this issue, we must ask two questions: (i) while they are parts of a substance, are such parts themselves substances? and (ii) are the parts of a substance themselves things that can exist without the substance of which they are parts?

Concerning (i) we must say that whilst they are parts of a substance such parts cannot be substances; this is so given the definition of substance outlined above: that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject. Given that the parts of a substance are in fact parts of a substance, it is their nature to exist in some subject  of which they are a part. Consequently, the parts of a substance cannot themselves be substances.

Concerning (ii) the case is somewhat different, now we must consider whether or not the parts of a substance can exist without the substance of which they are parts, that is, after the dissolution of the substance of which they are parts do the parts become substances in themselves? The parts of a substance receive their identity through being the parts of the substance whose parts they are. Thus, the flesh and bone of a human are flesh and bone precisely because they are parts of a human. When the human dies, the flesh and bone are no longer flesh and bone (except equivocally speaking) because they are no longer parts of a human substance; rather, the flesh and bone cease to function as flesh and bone and begin to decompose, in which case they are not themselves substances. However, on Aquinas’s view, the elements out of which a substance is made can indeed subsist beyond the dissolution of the substance. Thus, whilst the elements are parts of the substance, they are not, as parts of a substance, substances in themselves, but when the substance dissolves, the elements will remain as independent substances in their own right. Thus, in the case of the dissolution of the human being, whilst the flesh and bone no longer remain but decompose, the elements that played a role in the formation of the substance remain. In more contemporary terms we could say that before they go to make up the bodily substances we see in the world, atoms are substances in themselves, but when united in a certain form they go to make cats, dogs, humans, and cease to be independent substances in themselves. When the cat or dog or human perishes, its flesh and bones perish with it, but its atoms regain their substantial nature and they remain as substances in themselves. So, a substance can have its parts, and for as long as those parts are parts of a substance, those parts are not substances in themselves, but when the substance decomposes, those parts can be considered as substances in themselves so long as they are capable of subsisting in themselves.

5. Matter and Form


A very crude definition of matter would be that it is the ‘stuff’ out of which a thing is made, whereas form is signified by the organisation that the matter takes. A common example used by Aquinas and his contemporaries for explaining matter and form was that of a statue. Consider a marble statue. The marble is the matter of the statue whereas the shape signifies the form of the statue. The marble is the ‘stuff’ out of which the statue is made whereas the shape signifies the form that the artist decided to give to the statue. On a more metaphysical level, form is the principle whereby the matter has the particular structure that it has, and matter is simply that which stands to be structured in a certain way. It follows from this initial account that matter is a principle of potency in a thing; since if the matter is that which stands to be structured in a certain way, matter can be potentially an indefinite number of forms. Form on the other hand is not potentially one thing or another; form as form is the kind of thing that it is and no other.

On Aquinas’s account, there are certain levels of matter/form composition. On one level we can think of the matter of a statue as being the marble whereas we can think of the shape of the statue as signifying the form. But on a different level with can think of the marble as signifying the form and something more fundamental being the matter. For instance, before the marble was formed into the statue by the sculptor, it was a block of marble, already with a certain form that made it ‘marble’. At this level, the marble cannot be the matter of the thing, since its being marble and not, say, granite, is its form. Thus, there is a more fundamental level of materiality that admits of being formed in such a way that the end product is marble or granite, and at a higher level, this formed matter stands as matter for the artist when constructing the statue.

If we think of matter as without any form, we come to the notion of prime matter, and this is a type of matter that is totally unformed, pure materiality itself. Prime matter is the ultimate subject of form, and in itself indefinable; we can only understand prime matter through thinking of matter as wholly devoid of form. As wholly devoid of form prime matter is neither a substance nor any of the other categories of being; prime matter, as pure potency, cannot in fact express any concrete mode of being, since as pure potency is does not exist except as potency. Thus, prime matter is not a thing actually existing, since it has no principle of act rendering it actually existing.

Matter can be considered in two senses: (i) as designated and (ii) as undesignated. Designated matter is the type of matter to which one can point and of which one can make use. It is the matter that we see around us. Undesignated matter is a type of matter that we simply consider through the use of our reason; it is the abstracted notion of matter. For instance, the actual flesh and bones that make up an individual man are instances of designated matter, whereas the notions of ‘flesh’ and ‘bones’ are abstracted notions of certain types of matter and these are taken to enter into the definition of ‘man’ as such. Designated matter is what individuates some form. As noted, the form of a thing is the principle of its material organisation. A thing’s form then can apply to many different things insofar as those things are all organised in the same way. The form then can be said to be universal, since it remains the same but is predicated over different things. As signifying the actual matter that is organised in the thing, designated matter individuates the form to ‘this’ or ‘that’ particular thing, thereby ensuring individuals (Socrates, Plato, Aristotle) of the same form (man).

Given that form is the principle of organisation of a thing’s matter, or the thing’s intelligible nature, form can be of two kinds. On the one hand, form can be substantial, organising the matter into the kind of thing that the substance is. On the other hand, form can be accidental, organising some part of an already constituted substance. We can come to a greater understanding of substantial and accidental form if we consider their relation to matter. Substantial form always informs prime matter and in doing so it brings a new substance into existence; accidental form simply informs an already existing substance (an already existing composite of substantial form and prime matter), and in doing so it simply modifies some substance. Given that substantial form always informs prime matter, there can be only one substantial form of a thing; for if substantial form informs prime matter, any other form that may accrue to a thing is posterior to it and simply informs an already constituted substance, which is the role of accidental form. Thus, there can only be one substantial form of a thing.

As stated above, essence is signified by the definition of a thing; essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. A thing’s essence then is its definition. It follows that on Thomas’s account the essence of a thing is the composition of its matter and form, where matter here is taken as undesignated matter. Contrary to contemporary theories of essence, Aquinas does not, strictly speaking, take essence to be what is essential to the thing in question, where the latter is determined by a thing’s possessing some property or set of properties in all possible worlds. In the latter context, the essence of a thing comprises its essential properties, properties that are true of it in all possible worlds; but this is surely not Aquinas’s view. For Aquinas, the essence of a thing is not the conglomeration of those properties that it would possess in all possible worlds, but the composition of matter and form. On a possible-worlds view of essence, the essence of a thing could not signify the matter/form composite as it is in this actual world, since such a composite could be different in some possible world and therefore not uniform across all possible worlds. Thus, Aquinas does not adopt a possible-worlds view of essence; he envisages the essence of a thing as the definition or quiddity of the thing existing in this world, not as it would exist in all possible worlds.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • St Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province (1948), U.S.A: Christian Classics.
    • Aquinas’s philosophical and theological masterpiece; Part I (Prima Pars) is the most important for Thomas’s metaphysical thought.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, The Divisions and Methods of the Sciences: Questions V and VI of his Commentary on the De Trinitate of Boethius, trans. Armand Maurer (1953) Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
    • A detailed consideration by Thomas of the divisions and methods of the sciences.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, On Being and Essence, trans. Armand Maurer (1968), Toronto: Pontifical Institute Medieval Studies.
    • An excellent summary from Aquinas himself of his metaphysical views.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Summa Contra Gentiles, trans. A.C Pegis (1975), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • One of Aquinas’s great Summae; books I and II are most important for Thomas’s metaphysical thought.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, trans. John P. Rowan (1995), U.S.A: Dumb Ox Books.
    • A direct commentary on the Metaphysics of Aristotle.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Aquinas on matter and form and the elements: a translation and interpretation of the De principiis naturae and the De mixtione elementorum of St. Thomas Aquinas, trans. Joseph Bobik (1998), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • A translation of and commentary on Aqiunas’s works on ‘matter and form and the elements’.

b. General Studies

  • Clarke, W.N., Explorations in Metaphysics — Being, God, Person (1994), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Clarke, W.N., The One and the Many — A Contemporary Thomistic Metaphysics (2001), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Copleston, F., Aquinas (1955), London: Penguin.
  • Davies, B., The Thought of Thomas Aquinas (1993), Oxford: Clarendon Paperbacks.
  • Fabro, C., La Nozione Metafisica di Partecipazione secondo S. Tommaso d’Aquino (1950), Turin: Società Editrice Internazionale.
  • Fabro, C., Participation et causalité selon S. Thomas d’Aquin (1961), Louvain: Publications Universaitaires.
    • Both works by Fabro were groundbreaking for their uncovering the Platonic influences in Aquinas’s thought.
  • de Finance, J., Être et agir dans la philosophie de Saint Thomas (1960), Rome: Librairie Éditrice de l’Université Grégorienne.
  • Geiger, L-B., La participation dans la philosophie de s. Thomas d’Aquin (1953), Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
    • As with Fabro’s work, Geiger’s too uncovers the Platonic influences in Aquinas’s thought.
  • Kenny, A., Aquinas on Being (2003), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Klima, G., ‘Contemporary “Essentialism” vs. Aristotelian Essentialism’, in John Haldane, ed., Mind Metaphysics, and Value in the Thomistic and Analytical Traditions (2002), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kretzman, N., & Stump, E. eds. The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas (1993), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Long, S., ‘On the Natural Knowledge of the Real Distinction’, Nova et Vetera (2003), 1:1.
  • Long, S., ‘Aquinas on Being and Logicism’, New Blackfriars (2005), 86.
  • Owens, J., ‘A Note on the Approach to Thomistic Metaphysics’, The New Scholasticism (1954), 28:4.
  • Owens, J., ‘Quiddity and the Real Distinction in St Thomas Aquinas’, Mediaeval Studies (1965), 27.
  • Owens, J., The Doctrine of Being in the Aristotelian Metaphysics (1978), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
  • Owens, J., St Thomas Aquinas on the Existence of God — The Collected Papers of Joseph Owens ed. Catan, John. R. (1980), Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Owens, J., ‘Stages and Distinction in De Ente’, The Thomist, (1981), 45.
  • Owens, J., An Elementary Christian Metaphysics (1985), Houston, Texas: Bruce Publishing Company.
  • Owens, J., An Interpretation of Existence (1985), Texas: Center for Thomistic Studies — University of St Thomas.
  • Owens, J., ‘Aquinas’s Distinction at De Ente et Essentia 4.119 — 123’, Mediaeval Studies (1986), 48.
  • Patt, W. ‘Aquinas’s Real Distinction and some Interpretations’, The New Scholasticism (1988), 62:1.
  • Stump, E., Aquinas (2003), London-New York: Routledge.
    • Part I, Chapter I, offers a very good survey of Aquinas’s metaphysics, but leaves out details of his theory of essence/existence composition. Pp. 36 – 44 are particularly illuminating on matter and form, substance and accident.
  • Torrell, J.-P., Saint Thomas Aquinas: The Person and His Work, trans. Robert Royal (1996), Washington: The Catholic University of America Press.
    • This is the most up-to-date publication on Aquinas’s life and work.
  • te Velde R. A., Participation and Substantiality in Thomas Aquinas (1995), Leiden-New York-Cologne: E.J. Brill.
  • Wippel, J., 1979: ‘Aquinas’s Route to the Real Distinction’, The Thomist, 43.
  • Wippel, J.,  Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas (1984), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wippel, J.,  The Metaphysical Thought of Thomas Aquinas (2000), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wippel, J.,  Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas II (2007), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
    • Wippel’s work is generally taken to be essential for scholarly work on Aquinas’s metaphysical thought.


Author Information

Gaven Kerr
Queen's University Belfast
Northern Ireland


Immortality is the indefinite continuation of a person’s existence, even after death. In common parlance, immortality is virtually indistinguishable from afterlife, but philosophically speaking, they are not identical. Afterlife is the continuation of existence after death, regardless of whether or not that continuation is indefinite. Immortality implies a never-ending existence, regardless of whether or not the body dies (as a matter of fact, some hypothetical medical technologies offer the prospect of a bodily immortality, but not an afterlife).

Immortality has been one of mankind’s major concerns, and even though it has been traditionally mainly confined to religious traditions, it is also important to philosophy. Although a wide variety of cultures have believed in some sort of immortality, such beliefs may be reduced to basically three non-exclusive models: (1) the survival of the astral body resembling the physical body; (2) the immortality of the immaterial soul (that is an incorporeal existence); (3) resurrection of the body (or re-embodiment, in case the resurrected person does not keep the same body as at the moment of death). This article examines philosophical arguments for and against the prospect of immortality.

A substantial part of the discussion on immortality touches upon the fundamental question in the philosophy of mind: do souls exist? Dualists believe souls do exist and survive the death of the body; materialists believe mental activity is nothing but cerebral activity and thus death brings the total end of a person’s existence. However, some immortalists believe that, even if immortal souls do not exist, immortality may still be achieved through resurrection.

Discussions on immortality are also intimately related to discussions of personal identity because any account of immortality must address how the dead person could be identical to the original person that once lived. Traditionally, philosophers have considered three main criteria for personal identity: the soul criterion , the body criterion  and the psychological criterion.

Although empirical science has little to offer here, the field of parapsychology has attempted to offer empirical evidence in favor of an afterlife. More recently, secular futurists envision technologies that may suspend death indefinitely (such as Strategies for Engineered Negligible Senescence, and mind uploading), thus offering a prospect for a sort of bodily immortality.

Table of Contents

  1. Semantic Problems
  2. Three Models of Immortality
    1. The Survival of the Astral Body
    2. The Immaterial Soul
    3. The Resurrection of the Body
  3. Pragmatic Arguments for the Belief in Immortality
  4. Plato’s Arguments for Immortality
  5. Dualism
    1. Descartes’ Arguments for Dualism
    2. More Recent Dualist Arguments
    3. Arguments against Dualism
  6. A Brief Digression: Criteria for Personal Identity
    1. The Soul Criterion
    2. The Body Criterion
    3. The Psychological Criterion
    4. The Bundle Theory
  7. Problems with the Resurrection of the Body
  8. Parapsychology
    1. Reincarnation
    2. Mediums and Ghostly Apparitions
    3. Electronic-Voice Phenomena
    4. Near-Death Experiences
    5. Extrasensory Perception
  9. The Technological Prospect of Immortality
    1. Cryonics
    2. Strategies for Engineered Negligible Senescence
    3. Mind Uploading
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Semantic Problems

Discourse on immortality bears a semantic difficulty concerning the word 'death’. We usually define it in physiological terms as the cessation of biological functions that make life possible. But, if immortality is the continuation of life even after death, a contradiction appears to come up (Rosemberg, 1998). For apparently it makes no sense to say that someone has died and yet survived death. To be immortal is, precisely, not to suffer death. Thus, whoever dies, stops existing; nobody may exist after death, precisely because death means the end of existence.

For convenience, however, we may agree that ‘death’ simply means the decomposition of the body, but not necessarily the end of a person’s existence, as  assumed in most dictionary definitions. In such a manner, a person may ‘die’ in as much as their body no longer exists (or, to be more precise, no longer holds vital signs: pulse, brain activity, and so forth), but may continue to exist, either in an incorporeal state, with an ethereal body, or with some other physical body.

Some people may think of ‘immortality’ in vague and general terms, such as the continuity of a person’s deeds and memories among their friends and relatives. Thus, baseball player Babe Ruth is immortal in a very vague sense: he is well remembered among his fans. But, philosophically speaking, immortality implies the continuation of personal identity. Babe Ruth may be immortal in the sense that he is well remembered, but unless there is someone that may legitimately claim “I am Babe Ruth,” we shall presume Babe Ruth no longer exists and hence, is not immortal.

2. Three Models of Immortality

Despite the immense variety of beliefs on immortality, they may be reduced to three basic models: the survival of the astral body, the immaterial soul and resurrection (Flew, 2000). These models are not necessarily mutually exclusive; in fact, most religions have adhered to a combination of them.

a. The Survival of the Astral Body

Much primitive religious thought conceives that human beings are made up of two body substances: a physical body, susceptible of being touched, smelt, heard and seen; and an astral body made of some sort of mysterious ethereal substance. Unlike the physical body, the astral body has no solidity (it can go through walls, for example.) and hence, it cannot be touched, but it can be seen. Its appearance is similar to the physical body, except perhaps its color tonalities are lighter and its figure is fuzzier.

Upon death, the astral body detaches itself from the physical body, and mourns in some region within time and space. Thus, even if the physical body decomposes, the astral body survives. This is the type of immortality most commonly presented in films and literature (for example, Hamlet’s ghost). Traditionally, philosophers and theologians have not privileged this model of immortality, as there appears to be two insurmountable difficulties: 1) if the astral body does exist, it should be seen depart from the physical body at the moment of death; yet there is no evidence that accounts for it; 2) ghosts usually appear with clothes; this would imply that, not only are there astral bodies, but also astral clothes – a claim simply too extravagant to be taken seriously (Edwards, 1997: 21).

b. The Immaterial Soul

The model of the immortality of the soul is similar to the ‘astral body’ model, in as much as it considers that human beings are made up of two substances. But, unlike the ‘astral body’ model, this model conceives that the substance that survives the death of the body is not a body of some other sort, but rather, an immaterial soul. In as much as the soul is immaterial, it has no extension, and thus, it cannot be perceived through the senses. A few philosophers, such as Henry James, have come to believe that for something to exist, it must occupy space (although not necessarily physical space), and hence, souls are located somewhere in space (Henry, 2007). Up until the twentieth century, the majority of philosophers believed that persons are souls, and that human beings are made up of two substances (soul and body). A good portion of philosophers believed that the body is mortal and the soul is immortal. Ever since Descartes in the seventeenth century, most philosophers have considered that the soul is identical to the mind, and, whenever a person dies, their mental contents survive in an incorporeal state.

Eastern religions (for example, Hinduism and Buddhism) and some ancient philosophers (for example, Pythagoras and Plato) believed that immortal souls abandon the body upon death, may exist temporarily in an incorporeal state, and may eventually adhere to a new body at the time of birth (in some traditions, at the time of fertilization). This is the doctrine of reincarnation.

c. The Resurrection of the Body

Whereas most Greek philosophers believed that immortality implies solely the survival of the soul, the three great monotheistic religions (Judaism, Christianity and Islam) consider that immortality is achieved through the resurrection of the body at the time of the Final Judgment. The very same bodies that once constituted persons shall rise again, in order to be judged by God. None of these great faiths has a definite position on the existence of an immortal soul. Therefore, traditionally, Jews, Christians and Muslims have believed that, at the time of death, the soul detaches from the body and continues on to exist in an intermediate incorporeal state until the moment of resurrection. Some others, however, believe that there is no intermediate state: with death, the person ceases to exist, and in a sense, resumes existence at the time of resurrection.

As we shall see, some philosophers and theologians have postulated the possibility that, upon resurrection, persons do not rise with the very same bodies with which they once lived (rather, resurrected persons would be constituted by a replica). This version of the doctrine of the resurrection would be better referred to as ‘re-embodiment’: the person dies, but, as it were, is ‘re-embodied’.

3. Pragmatic Arguments for the Belief in Immortality

Most religions adhere to the belief in immortality on the basis of faith. In other words, they provide no proof of the survival of the person after the death of the body; actually, their belief in immortality appeals to some sort of divine revelation that, allegedly, does not require rationalization.

Natural theology, however, attempts to provide rational proofs of God’s existence. Some philosophers have argued that, if we can rationally prove that God exists, then we may infer that we are immortal. For, God, being omnibenevolent, cares about us, and thus would not allow the annihilation of our existence; and being just, would bring about a Final Judgement (Swinburne, 1997). Thus, the traditional arguments in favor of the existence of God (ontological, cosmological, teleological) would indirectly prove our immortality. However, these traditional arguments have been notoriously criticized, and some arguments against the existence of God have also been raised (such as the problem of evil) (Martin, 1992; Smith, 1999).

Nevertheless, some philosophers have indeed tried to rationalize the doctrine of immortality, and have come up with a few pragmatic arguments in its favor.

Blaise Pascal proposed a famous argument in favor of the belief in the existence of God, but it may well be extended to the belief in immortality (Pascal, 2005). The so-called ‘Pascal’s Wager’ argument goes roughly as follows: if we are to decide to believe whether God exists or not, it is wiser to believe that God does exist. If we rightly believe that God exists, , we gain eternal bliss; if God does not exist, we lose nothing, in as much as there is no Final Judgment to account for our error. On the other hand, if we rightly believe God does not exist, we gain nothing, in as much as there is no Final Judgment to reward our belief. But, if we wrongly believe that God does not exist, we lose eternal bliss, and are therefore damned to everlasting Hell. By a calculation of risks and benefits, we should conclude that it is better to believe in God’s existence. This argument is easily extensible to the belief in immortality: it is better to believe that there is a life after death, because if in fact there is a life after death, we shall be rewarded for our faith, and yet lose nothing if we are wrong; on the other hand, if we do not believe in a life after death, and we are wrong, we will be punished by God, and if we are right, there will not be a Final Judgment to reward our belief.

Although this argument has remained popular among some believers, philosophers have identified too many problems in it (Martin, 1992). Pascal’s Wager does not take into account the risk of believing in a false god (What if Baal were the real God, instead of the Christian God?), or the risk of believing in the wrong model of immortality (what if God rewarded belief in reincarnation, and punished belief in resurrection?). The argument also assumes that we are able to choose our beliefs, something most philosophers think very doubtful.

Other philosophers have appealed to other pragmatic benefits of the belief in immortality. Immanuel Kant famously rejected in his Critique of Pure Reason the traditional arguments in favor of the existence of God; but in his Critique of Practical Reason he put forth a so-called ‘moral argument’. The argument goes roughly as follows: belief in God and immortality is a prerequisite for moral action; if people do not believe there is a Final Judgment administered by God to account for deeds, there will be no motivation to be good. In Kant’s opinion, human beings seek happiness. But in order for happiness to coincide with moral action, the belief in an afterlife is necessary, because moral action does not guarantee happiness. Thus, the only way that a person may be moral and yet preserve happiness, is by believing that there will be an afterlife justice that will square morality with happiness. Perhaps Kant’s argument is more eloquently expressed in Ivan Karamazov’s (a character from Dostoevsky’s The Brothers Karamazov) famous phrase: “If there is no God, then everything is permitted... if there is no immortality, there is no virtue”.

The so-called ‘moral argument’ has been subject to some criticism. Many philosophers have argued that it is indeed possible to construe secular ethics, where appeal to God is unnecessary to justify morality. The question “why be moral?” may be answered by appealing to morality itself, to the need for cooperation, or simply, to one’s own pleasure (Singer, 1995; Martin, 1992). A vigilant God does not seem to be a prime need in order for man to be good. If these philosophers are right, the lack of belief in immortality would not bring about the collapse of morality. Some contemporary philosophers, however, align with Kant and believe that secular morality is shallow, as it does not satisfactorily account for acts of sacrifice that go against self-interest; in their view, the only way to account for such acts is by appealing to a Divine Judge (Mavrodes, 1995).

Yet another pragmatic argument in favor of the belief in immortality appeals to the need to find meaning in life. Perhaps Miguel de Unamuno’s Del sentimiento tràgico de la vida is the most emblematic philosophical treatise advocating this argument: in Unamuno’s opinion, belief in immortality is irrational, but nevertheless necessary to avoid desperation in the face of life’s absurdity. Only by believing that our lives will have an ever-lasting effect, do we find motivation to continue to live. If, on the contrary, we believe that everything will ultimately come to an end and nothing will survive, it becomes pointless to carry on any activity.

Of course, not all philosophers would agree. Some philosophers would argue that, on the contrary, the awareness that life is temporal and finite makes living more meaningful, in as much as we better appreciate opportunities (Heidegger, 1978). Bernard Williams has argued that, should life continue indefinitely, it would be terribly boring, and therefore, pointless (Williams, 1976). Some philosophers, however, counter that some activities may be endlessly repeated without ever becoming boring; furthermore, a good God would ensure that we never become bored in Heaven (Fischer, 2009).

Death strikes fear and anguish in many of us, and some philosophers argue that the belief in immortality is a much needed resource to cope with that fear. But, Epicurus famously argued that it is not rational to fear death, for two main reasons: 1) in as much as death is the extinction of consciousness, we are not aware of our condition (“if death is, I am not; if I am, death is not”); 2) in the same manner that we do not worry about the time that has passed before we were born, we should not worry about the time that will pass after we die (Rist, 1972).

At any rate, pragmatic arguments in favor of the belief in immortality are also critiqued on the grounds that the pragmatic benefits of a belief bear no implications on its truth. In other words, the fact that a belief is beneficial does not make it true. In the analytic tradition, philosophers have long argued for and against the pragmatic theory of truth, and depending on how this theory is valued, it will offer a greater or lesser plausibility to the arguments presented above.

4. Plato’s Arguments for Immortality

Plato was the first philosopher to argue, not merely in favor of the convenience of accepting the belief in immortality, but for the truth of the belief itself. His Phaedo is a dramatic representation of Socrates’ final discussion with his disciples, just before drinking the hemlock. Socrates shows no sign of fear or concern, for he is certain that he will survive the death of his body. He presents three main arguments to support his position, and some of these arguments are still in use today.

First, Socrates appeals to cycles and opposites. He believes that everything  has an opposite that is implied by it. And, as in cycles, things not only come from opposites, but also go towards opposites. Thus, when something is hot, it was previously cold; or when we are awake, we were previously asleep; but when we are asleep, we shall be awake once again. In the same manner, life and death are opposites in a cycle. Being alive is opposite to being dead. And, in as much as death comes from life, life must come from death. We come from death, and we go towards death. But, again, in as much as death comes from life, it will also go towards life. Thus, we had a life before being born, and we shall have a life after we die.

Most philosophers have not been persuaded by this argument. It is very doubtful that everything has an opposite (What is the opposite of a computer?) And, even if everything had an opposite, it is doubtful that everything comes from its opposite, or even that everything goes towards its opposite.

Socrates also appeals to the theory of reminiscence, the view that learning is really a process of ‘remembering’ knowledge from past lives. The soul must already exist before the birth of the body, because we seem to know things that were not available to us. Consider the knowledge of equality. If we compare two sticks and we realize they are not equal, we form a judgment on the basis of a previous knowledge of ‘equality’ as a form. That knowledge must come from previous lives. Therefore, this is an argument in favor of the transmigration of souls (that is, reincarnation or metempsychosis).

Some philosophers would dispute the existence of the Platonic forms, upon which this argument rests. And, the existence of innate ideas does not require the appeal to previous lives. Perhaps we are hard-wired by our brains to believe certain things; thus, we may know things that were not available to us previously.

Yet another of Socrates’ arguments appeals to the affinity between the soul and the forms. In Plato’s understanding, forms are perfect, immaterial and eternal. And, in as much as the forms are intelligible, but not sensible, only the soul can apprehend them. In order to apprehend something, the thing apprehending must have the same nature as the thing apprehended. The soul, then, shares the attributes of the forms: it is immaterial and eternal, and hence, immortal.

Again, the existence of the Platonic forms should not be taken for granted, and for this reason, this is not a compelling argument. Furthermore, it is doubtful that the thing apprehending must have the same nature as the thing apprehended: a criminologist need not be a criminal in order to apprehend the nature of crime.

5. Dualism

Plato’s arguments take for granted that souls exist; he only attempts to prove that they are immortal. But, a major area of discussion in the philosophy of mind is the existence of the soul. One of the doctrines that hold that the soul does exist is called ‘dualism’; its name comes from the fact that it postulates that human beings are made up of two substances: body and soul. Arguments in favor of dualism are indirectly arguments in favor of immortality, or at least in favor of the possibility of survival of death. For, if the soul exists, it is an immaterial substance. And, in as much as it is an immaterial substance, it is not subject to the decomposition of material things; hence, it is immortal.

Most dualists agree that the soul is identical to the mind, yet different from the brain or its functions. Some dualists believe the mind may be some sort of emergent property of the brain: it depends on the brain, but it is not identical to the brain or its processes. This position is often labeled ‘property dualism’, but here we are concerned with substance dualism, that is, the doctrine that holds that the mind is a separate substance (and not merely a separate property) from the body, and therefore, may survive the death of the body (Swinburne, 1997).

a. Descartes’ Arguments for Dualism

René Descartes is usually considered the father of dualism, as he presents some very ingenuous arguments in favor of the existence of the soul as a separate substance (Descartes, 1980). In perhaps his most celebrated argument, Descartes invites a thought experiment: imagine you exist, but not your body. You wake up in the morning, but as you approach the mirror, you do not see yourself there. You try to reach your face with your hand, but it is thin air. You try to scream, but no sound comes out. And so on.

Now, Descartes believes that it is indeed possible to imagine such a scenario. But, if one can imagine the existence of a person without the existence of the body, then persons are not constituted by their bodies, and hence, mind and body are two different substances. If the mind were identical to the body, it would be impossible to imagine the existence of the mind without imagining at the same time the existence of the body.

This argument has been subject to much scrutiny. Dualists certainly believe it is a valid one, but it is not without its critics. Descartes seems to assume that everything that is imaginable is possible. Indeed, many philosophers have long agreed that imagination is a good guide as to what is possible (Hume, 2010). But, this criterion is disputed. Imagination seems to be a psychological process, and thus not strictly a logical process. Therefore, perhaps we can imagine scenarios that are not really possible. Consider the Barber Paradox. At first, it seems possible that, in a town, a man shaves only those persons that shave themselves. We may perhaps imagine such a situation, but logically there cannot be such a situation, as Bertrand Russell showed. The lesson to be learned is that imagination might not be a good guide to possibility. And, although Descartes appears to have no trouble imagining an incorporeal mind, such a scenario might not be possible. However, dualists may argue that there is no neat difference between a psychological and a logical process, as logic seems to be itself a psychological process.

Descartes presents another argument. As Leibniz would later formalize in the Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles, two entities can be considered identical, if and only if, they exhaustively share the same attributes. Descartes exploits this principle, and attempts to find a property of the mind not shared by the body (or vice versa), in order to argue that they are not identical, and hence, are separate substances.

Descartes states: “There is a great difference between a mind and a body, because the body, by its very nature, is something divisible, whereas the mind is plainly indivisible. . . insofar as I am only a thing that thinks, I cannot distinguish any parts in me. . . . Although the whole mind seems to be united to the whole body, nevertheless, were a foot or an arm or any other bodily part amputated, I know that nothing would be taken away from the mind” (Descartes, 1980: 97).

Descartes believed, then, that mind and body cannot be the same substance. Descartes put forth another similar argument: the body has extension in space, and as such, it can be attributed physical properties. We may ask, for instance, what the weight of a hand is, or what the longitude of a leg is. But the mind has no extension, and therefore, it has no physical properties. It makes no sense to ask what the color of the desire to eat strawberries is, or what the weight of Communist ideology is. If the body has extension, and the mind has no extension, then the mind can be considered a separate substance.

Yet another of Descartes’ arguments appeals to some difference between mind and body. Descartes famously contemplated the possibility that an evil demon might be deceiving him about the world. Perhaps the world is not real. In as much as that possibility exists, Descartes believed that one may be doubt the existence of one’s own body. But, Descartes argued that one cannot doubt the existence of one’s own mind. For, if one doubts, one is thinking; and if one thinks, then it can be taken for certain that one’s mind exists. Hence Descartes famous phrase: “cogito ergo sum”, I think, therefore, I exist. Now, if one may doubt the existence of one’s body, but cannot doubt the existence of one’s mind, then mind and body are different substances. For, again, they do not share exhaustively the same attributes.

These arguments are not without critics. Indeed, Leibniz’s Principle of Indiscernibles would lead us to think that, in as much as mind and body do not exhaustively share the same properties, they cannot be the same substance. But, in some contexts, it seems possible that A and B may be identical, even if that does not imply that everything predicated of A can be predicated of B.

Consider, for example, a masked man that robs a bank. If we were to ask a witness whether or not the masked man robbed the bank, the witness will answer “yes!”. But, if we were to ask the witness whether his father robbed the bank, he may answer “no”. That, however, does not imply that the witness’ father is not the bank robber: perhaps the masked man was the witness’ father, and the witness was not aware of it. This is the so-called ‘Masked Man Fallacy’.

This case forces us to reconsider Leibniz’s Law: A is identical to B, not if everything predicated of A is predicated of B, but rather, when A and B share exhaustively the same properties. And, what people believe about substances are not properties. To be an object of doubt is not, strictly speaking, a property, but rather, an intentional relation. And, in our case, to be able to doubt the body’s existence, but not the mind’s existence, does not imply that mind and body are not the same substance.

b. More Recent Dualist Arguments

In more recent times, Descartes’ strategy has been used by other dualist philosophers to account for the difference between mind and body. Some philosophers argue that the mind is private, whereas the body is not. Any person may know the state of my body, but no person, including even possibly myself, can truly know the state of my mind.

Some philosophers point ‘intentionality’ as another difference between mind and body. The mind has intentionality, whereas the body does not. Thoughts are about something, whereas body parts are not. In as much as thoughts have intentionality, they may also have truth values. Not all thoughts, of course, are true or false, but at least those thoughts that pretend to represent the world, may be. On the other hand, physical states do not have truth values: neurons activating in the brain are neither ‘true’, nor ‘false’.

Again, these arguments exploit the differences between mind and body. But, very much as with Descartes’ arguments, it is not absolutely clear that they avoid the Masked Man Fallacy.

c. Arguments against Dualism

Opponents of dualism not only reject their arguments; they also highlight conceptual and empirical problems with this doctrine. Most opponents of dualism are materialists: they believe that mental stuff is really identical to the brain, or at the most, an epiphenomenon of the brain. Materialism limits the prospects for immortality: if the mind is not a separate substance from the brain, then at the time of the brain’s death, the mind also becomes extinct, and hence, the person does not survive death. Materialism need not undermine all expectations of immortality (see resurrection below), but it does undermine the immortality of the soul.

The main difficulty with dualism is the so-called ‘interaction problem’. If the mind is an immaterial substance, how can it interact with material substances? The desire to move my hand allegedly moves my hand, but how exactly does that occur? There seems to be an inconsistency with the mind’s immateriality: some of the time, the mind is immaterial and is not affected by material states, at other times, the mind manages to be in contact with the body and cause its movement. Daniel Dennett has ridiculed this inconsistency by appealing to the comic-strip character Casper. This friendly ghost is immaterial because he is able to go through walls. But, all of a sudden, he is also able to catch a ball. The same inconsistency appears with dualism: in its interaction with the body, sometimes the mind does not interact with the body, sometimes it does (Dennett, 1992).Dualists have offered some solutions to this problem. Occasionalists hold that God directly causes material events. Thus, mind and body never interact. Likewise, parallelists hold that mental and physical events are coordinated by God so that they appear to cause each other, but in fact, they do not. These alternatives are in fact rejected by most contemporary philosophers.

Some dualists, however, may reply that the fact that we cannot fully explain how body and soul interact, does not imply that interaction does not take place. We know many things happen in the universe, although we do not know how they happen. Richard Swinburne, for instance, argues as follows: “That bodily events cause brain events and that these cause pains, images, and beliefs (where their subjects have privileged access to the latter and not the former), is one of the most obvious phenomena of human experience. If we cannot explain how that occurs, we should not try to pretend that it does not occur. We should just acknowledge that human beings are not omniscient, and cannot understand everything” (Swinburne, 1997, xii).

On the other hand, Dualism postulates the existence of an incorporeal mind, but it is not clear that this is a coherent concept. In the opinion of most dualists, the incorporeal mind does perceive. But, it is not clear how the mind can perceive without sensory organs. Descartes seemed to have no problems in imagining an incorporeal existence, in his thought experiment. However, John Hospers, for instance, believes that such a scenario is simply not imaginable:

You see with eyes? No, you have no eyes, since you have no body. But let that pass for a moment; you have experiences similar to what you would have if you had eyes to see with. But how can you look toward the foot of the bed or toward the mirror? Isn’t looking an activity that requires having a body? How can you look in one direction or another if you have no head to turn? And this isn’t all; we said that you can’t touch your body because there is no body there; how did you discover this?... Your body seems to be involved in every activity we try to describe even though we have tried to imagine existing without it. (Hospers, 1997: 280)

Furthermore, even if an incorporeal existence were in fact possible, it could be terribly lonely. For, without a body, could it be possible to communicate with other minds. In Paul Edward’s words: “so far from living on in paradise, a person deprived of his body and thus of all sense organs would, quite aside from many other gruesome deprivations, be in a state of desolate loneliness and eventually come to prefer annihilation”. (Edwards, 1997:48). However, consider that, even in the absence of a body, great pleasures may be attained. We may live in a situation the material world is an illusion (in fact, idealists inspired in Berkley lean towards such a position), and yet, enjoy existence. For, even without a body, we may enjoy sensual pleasures that, although not real, certainly feel real. However, the problems with dualism do not end there. If souls are immaterial and have no spatial extension, how can they be separate from other souls? Separation implies extension. Yet, if the soul has no extension, it is not at all clear how one soul can be distinguished from another. Perhaps souls can be distinguished based on their contents, but then again, how could we distinguish two souls with exactly the same contents? Some contemporary dualists have responded thus: in as much as souls interact with bodies, they have a spatial relationships to bodies, and in a sense, can be individuated.

Perhaps the most serious objection to dualism, and a substantial argument in favor of materialism, is the mind’s correlation with the brain. Recent developments in neuroscience increasingly confirm that mental states depend upon brain states. Neurologists have been able to identify certain regions of the brain associated with specific mental dispositions. And, in as much as there appears to be a strong correlation between mind and brain, it seems that the mind may be reducible to the brain, and would therefore not be a separate substance.

In the last recent decades, neuroscience has accumulated data that confirm that cerebral damage has a great influence on the mental constitution of persons. Phineas Gage’s case is well-known in this respect: Gage had been a responsible and kind railroad worker, but had an accident that resulted in damage to the frontal lobes of his brain. Ever since, Gage turned into an aggressive, irresponsible person, unrecognizable by his peers (Damasio, 2006).

Departing from Gage’s case, scientists have inferred that frontal regions of the brain strongly determine personality. And, if mental contents can be severely damaged by brain injuries, it does not seem right to postulate that the mind is an immaterial substance. If, as dualism postulates, Gage had an immortal immaterial soul, why didn’t his soul remain intact after his brain injury?

A similar difficulty arises when we consider degenerative neurological diseases, such as Alzheimer’s disease. As it is widely known, this disease progressively eradicates the mental contents of patients, until patients lose memory almost completely. If most memories eventually disappear, what remains of the soul? When a patient afflicted with Alzheimer dies, what is it that survives, if precisely, most of his memories have already been lost? Of course, correlation is not identity, and the fact that the brain is empirically correlated with the mind does not imply that the mind is the brain. But, many contemporary philosophers of mind adhere to the so-called ‘identity theory’: mental states are the exact same thing as the firing of specific neurons.

Dualists may respond by claiming that the brain is solely an instrument of the soul. If the brain does not work properly, the soul will not work properly, but brain damage does not imply a degeneration of the soul. Consider, for example, a violinist. If the violin does not play accurately, the violinist will not perform well. But, that does not imply that the violinist has lost their talent. In the same manner, a person may have a deficient brain, and yet, retain her soul intact. However, Occam’s Razor requires the more parsimonious alternative: in which case, unless there is any compelling evidence in its favor, there is no need to assume the existence of a soul that uses the brain as its instrument.

Dualists may also suggest that the mind is not identical to the soul. In fact, whereas many philosophers tend to consider the soul and mind identical, various religions consider that a person is actually made up of by three substances: body, mind and soul. In such a view, even if the mind degenerates, the soul remains. However, it would be far from clear what the soul exactly could be, if it is not identical to the mind.

6. A Brief Digression: Criteria for Personal Identity

Any philosophical discussion on immortality touches upon a fundamental issue concerning persons–personal identity. If we hope to survive death, we would want to be sure that the person that continues to exist after death is the same person that existed before death. And, for religions that postulate a Final Judgment, this is a crucial matter: if God wants to apply justice, the person rewarded or punished in the afterlife must be the very same person whose deeds determine the outcome.

The question of personal identity refers to the criterion upon which a person remains the same (that is, numerical identity) throughout time. Traditionally, philosophers have discussed three main criteria: soul, body and psychological continuity.

a. The Soul Criterion

According to the soul criterion for personal identity, persons remains the same throughout time, if and only if, they retain their soul (Swinburne, 2004). Philosophers who adhere to this criterion usually do not think the soul is identical to the mind. The soul criterion is favored by very few philosophers, as it faces a huge difficulty: if the soul is an immaterial non-apprehensible substance (precisely, in as much as it is not identical to the mind), how can we be sure that a person continues to be the same? We simply do not know if, in the middle of the night, our neighbor’s soul has transferred into another body. Even if our neighbor’s body and mental contents remain the same, we can never know if his soul is the same. Under this criterion, it appears that there is simply no way to make sure someone is always the same person.

However, there is a considerable argument in favor of the soul criterion. To pursue such an argument, Richard Swinburne proposes the following thought experiment: suppose John’s brain is successfully split in two, and as a result, we get two persons; one with the left hemisphere of John’s brain, the other with the right hemisphere. Now, which one is John? Both have a part of John’s brain, and both conserve part of John’s mental contents.  So, one of them must presumably be John, but which one? Unlike the body and the mind, the soul is neither divisible nor duplicable. Thus, although we do not know which would be John, we do know that only one of the two persons is John. And it would be the person that preserves John’s souls, even if we have no way of identifying it. In such a manner, although we know about John’s body and mind, we are not able to discern who is John; therefore, John’s identity is not his mind or his body, but rather, his soul (Swinburne, 2010: 68).

b. The Body Criterion

Common sense informs that persons are their bodies (in fact, that is how we recognize people ) but, although many philosophers would dispute this,  ordinary people seem generally to adhere to such a view). Thus, under this criterion, a person continues to be the same, if, and only if, they conserve the same body. Of course, the body alters, and eventually, all of its cells are replaced. This evokes the ancient philosophical riddle known as the Ship of Theseus: the planks of Theseus’ ship were gradually replaced, until none of the originals remained. Is it still the same ship? There has been much discussion on this, but most philosophers agree that, in the case of the human body, the total replacement of atoms and the slight alteration of form do not alter the numerical identity of the human body.

However, the body criterion soon runs into difficulties. Imagine two patients, Brown and Robinson, who undergo surgery simultaneously. Accidentally, their brains are swapped in placed in the wrong body. Thus, Brown’s brain is placed in Robinson’s body. Let us call this person Brownson. Naturally, in as much as he has Brown’s brain, he will have Brown’s memories, mental contents, and so forth. Now, who is Brownson? Is he Robinson with Brown’s brain; or is he Brown with Robinson’s body? Most people would think the latter (Shoemaker, 2003). After all, the brain is the seat of consciousness.

Thus, it would appear that the body criterion must give way to the brain criterion: a person continues to be the same, if and only if, she conserves the same brain. But, again, we run into difficulties. What if the brain undergoes fission, and each half is placed in a new body? (Parfit, 1984). As a result, we would have two persons pretending to be the original person, but, because of the principle of transitivity, we know that both of them cannot be the original person. And, it seems arbitrary that one of them should be the original person, and not the other (although, as we have seen, Swinburne bites the bullet, and considers that, indeed, only one would be the original person). This difficulty invites the consideration of other criteria for personal identity.

c. The Psychological Criterion

John Locke famously asked what we would think if a prince one day woke up in a cobbler’s body, and the cobbler in a prince’s body (Locke, 2009). Although the cobbler’s peers would recognize him as the cobbler, he would have the memories of the prince. Now, if before that event, the prince committed a crime, who should be punished? Should it be the man in the palace, who remembers being a cobbler; or should it be the man in the workshop, who remembers being a prince, including his memory of the crime?

It seems that the man in the workshop should be punished for the prince’s crime, because, even if that is not the prince’s original body, that person is the prince, in as much as he conserves his memories. Locke, therefore, believed that a person continues to be the same, if and only if, she conserves psychological continuity.

Although it appears to be an improvement with regards to the previous two criteria, the psychological criterion also faces some problems. Suppose someone claims today to be Guy Fawkes, and conserves intact very vividly and accurately the memories of the seventeenth century conspirator (Williams, 1976). By the psychological criterion, such a person would indeed be Guy Fawkes. But, what if, simultaneously, another person also claims to be Guy Fawkes, even with the same degree of accuracy? Obviously, both persons cannot be Guy Fawkes. Again, it would seem arbitrary to conclude that one person is Guy Fawkes, yet the other person isn’t. It seems more plausible that neither person is Guy Fawkes, and therefore, that psychological continuity is not a good criterion for personal identity.

d. The Bundle Theory

In virtue of the difficulties with the above criteria, some philosophers have argued that, in a sense, persons do not exist. Or, to be more precise, the self does not endure changes. In David Hume’s words, a person is “nothing but a bundle or collection of different perceptions, which succeed each other with an inconceivable rapidity, and are in a perpetual flux and movement” (Hume, 2010: 178). This is the so-called ‘bundle theory of the self’.

As a corollary, Derek Parfit argues that, when considering survival, personal identity is not what truly matters (Parfit, 1984). What does matter is psychological continuity. Parfit asks us to consider this example.

Suppose that you enter a cubicle in which, when you press a button, a scanner records the states of all the cells in your brain and body, destroying both while doing so. This information is then transmitted at the speed of light to some other planet, where a replicator produces a perfect organic copy of you. Since the brain of your replica is exactly like yours, it will seem to remember living your life up to the moment when you pressed the button, its character will be just like yours, it will be every other way psychologically continuous with you. (Parfit, 1997: 311)

Now, under the psychological criterion, such a replica will in fact be you. But, what if the machine does not destroy the original body, or makes more than one replica? In such a case, there will be two persons claiming to be you. As we have seen, this is a major problem for the psychological criterion. But, Parfit argues that, even if the person replicated is not the same person that entered the cubicle, it is psychologically continuous. And, that is what is indeed relevant.

Parfit’s position has an important implication for discussions of immortality. According to this view, a person in the afterlife is not the same person that lived before. But, that should not concern us. We should be concerned about the prospect that, in the afterlife, there will at least be one person that is psychologically continuous with us.

7. Problems with the Resurrection of the Body

As we have seen, the doctrine of resurrection postulates that on Judgment Day the bodies of every person who ever lived shall rise again, in order to be judged by God. Unlike the doctrine of the immortality of the soul, the doctrine of resurrection has not been traditionally defended with philosophical arguments. Most of its adherents accept it on the basis of faith. Some Christians, however, consider that the resurrection of Jesus can be historically demonstrated (Habermas, 2002; Craig, 2008). And, so the argument goes, if it can be proven that God resurrected Jesus from the dead, then we can expect that God will do the same with every human being who has ever lived.

Nevertheless, the doctrine of resurrection runs into some philosophical problems derived from considerations on personal identity; that is, how is the person resurrected identical to the person that once lived? If we were to accept dualism and the soul criterion for personal identity, then there is not much of a problem: upon the moment of death, soul and body split, the soul remains incorporeal until the moment of resurrection, and the soul becomes attached to the new resurrected body. In as much as a person is the same, if and only if, she conserves the same soul, then we may legitimately claim that the resurrected person is identical to the person that once lived.

But, if we reject dualism, or the soul criterion for personal identity, then we must face some difficulties. According to the most popular one conception of resurrection, we shall be raised with the same bodies with which we once lived. Suppose that the resurrected body is in fact made of the very same cells that made up the original body, and also, the resurrected body has the same form as the original body. Are they identical?

Peter Van Inwagen thinks not (Van Inwagen, 1997). If, for example, an original manuscript written by Augustine is destroyed, and then, God miraculously recreates a manuscript with the same atoms that made up Augustine’s original manuscript, we should not consider it the very same manuscript. It seems that, between Augustine’s original manuscript, and the manuscript recreated by God, there is no spatio-temporal continuity. And, if such continuity is lacking, then we cannot legitimately claim that the recreated object is the same original object. For the same reason, it appears that the resurrected body cannot be identical to the original body. At most, the resurrected body would be a replica.

However, our intuitions are not absolutely clear. Consider, for example, the following case: a bicycle is exhibited in a store, and a customer buys it. In order to take it home, the customer dismantles the bicycle, puts its pieces in a box, takes it home, and once there, reassembles the pieces. Is it the same bicycle? It certainly seems so, even if there is no spatio-temporal continuity.

Nevertheless, there is room to doubt that the resurrected body would be made up of the original body’s same atoms. We know that matter recycles itself, and that due to metabolism, the atoms that once constituted the human body of a person may later constitute the body of another person. How could God resurrect bodies that shared the same atoms? Consider the case of cannibalism, as ridiculed by Voltaire:

A soldier from Brittany goes into Canada; there, by a very common chance, he finds himself short of food, and is forced to eat an Iroquis whom he killed the day before. The Iroquis had fed on Jesuits for two or three months; a great part of his body had become Jesuit. Here, then, the body of a soldier is composed of Iroquis, of Jesuits, and of all that he had eaten before. How is each to take again precisely what belongs to him? And which part belongs to each? (Voltaire, 1997: 147)

However, perhaps, in the resurrection, God needn’t resurrect the body. If we accept the body criterion for personal identity, then, indeed, the resurrected body must be the same original body. But, if we accept the psychological criterion, perhaps God only needs to recreate a person psychologically continuous with the original person, regardless of whether or not that person has the same body. John Hick believes this is how God could indeed proceed (Hick, 1994).

Hick invites a thought experiment. Suppose a man disappears in London, and suddenly someone with his same looks and personality appears in New York. It seems reasonable to consider that the person that disappeared in London is the same person that appeared in New York. Now, suppose that a man dies in London, and suddenly appears in New York with the same looks and personality. Hick believes that, even if the cadaver is in London, we would be justified to claim that the person that appears in New York is the same person that died in London. Hick’s implication is that body continuity is not needed for personal identity; only psychologically continuity is necessary.

And, Hick considers that, in the same manner, if a person dies, and someone in the resurrection world appears with the same character traits, memories, and so forth, then we should conclude that such a person in the resurrected world is identical to the person who previously died. Hick admits the resurrected body would be a replica, but as long as the resurrected is psychologically continuous with the original person, then it is identical to the original person.

Yet, in as much as Hick’s model depends upon a psychological criterion for personal identity, it runs into the same problems that we have reviewed when considering the psychological criterion. It seems doubtful that a replica would be identical to the original person, because more than one replica could be recreated. And, if there is more than one replica, then they would all claim to be the original person, but obviously, they cannot all be the original person. Hick postulates that we can trust that God would only recreate exactly one replica, but it is not clear how that would solve the problem. For, the mere possibility that God could make more than one replica is enough to conclude that a replica would not be the original person.

Peter Van Inwagen has offered a somewhat extravagant solution to these problems: “Perhaps at the moment of each man’s death, God removes his corpse and replaces it with a simulacrum which is what is burned or rots. Or perhaps God is not quite so wholesale as this: perhaps He removes for ‘safekeeping’ only the ‘core person’ – the brain and central nervous system – or even some special part of it” (Van Inwagen, 1997: 246). This would seem to solve the problem of spatio-temporal continuity. The body would never cease to exist, it would only be stored somewhere else until the moment of resurrection, and therefore, it would conserve spatio-temporal continuity. However, such an alternative seems to presuppose a deceitful God (He would make us believe the corpse that rots is the original one, when in fact, it is not), and would thus contradict the divine attribute of benevolence (a good God would not lie), a major tenet of monotheistic religions that defend the doctrine of resurrection.

Some Christian philosophers are aware of all these difficulties, and have sought a more radical solution: there is no criterion for personal identity over time. Such a view is not far from the bundle theory, in the sense that it is difficult to precise how a person remains the same over time. This position is known as ‘anti-criterialism’, that is, there is no intelligible criterion for personal identity; Trenton Merricks (1998) is its foremost proponent. By doing away with criteria for personal identity, anti-criterialists purport to show that objections to resurrection based on difficulties of personal identity have little weight, precisely because we should not be concerned about criteria for personal identity.

8. Parapsychology

The discipline of parapsychology purports to prove that there is scientific evidence for the afterlife; or at least, that there is scientific evidence for the existence of paranormal abilities that would imply that the mind is not a material substance. Originally founded by J.B.S. Rhine in the 1950s, parapsychology has fallen out of favor among contemporary neuroscientists, although some universities still support parapsychology departments.

a. Reincarnation

Parapsychologists usually claim there is a good deal of evidence in favor of the doctrine of reincarnation. Two pieces of alleged evidence are especially meaningful: (1) past-life regressions; (2) cases of children who apparently remember past lives.

Under hypnosis, some patients frequently have regressions and remember events from their childhood. But, some patients have gone even further and, allegedly, have vivid memories of past lives. A few parapsychologists take these as so-called ‘past-life regressions’ as evidence for reincarnation (Sclotterbeck, 2003).

However, past-life regressions may be cases of cryptomnesia, that is, hidden memories. A person may have a memory, and yet not recognize it as such. A well-known case is illustrative: an American woman in the 1950s was hypnotized, and claimed to be Bridey Murphy, an Irishwoman of the 19th century. Under hypnosis, the woman offered a fairly good description of 19th century Ireland, although she had never been in Ireland. However, it was later discovered that, as a child, she had an Irish neighbor. Most likely, she had hidden memories of that neighbor, and under hypnosis, assumed the personality of a 20th century Irish woman.

It must also be kept in mind that hypnosis is a state of high suggestibility. The person that conducts the hypnosis may easily induce false memories on the person hypnotized; hence, alleged memories that come up in hypnosis are not trustworthy at all.

Some children have claimed to remember past lives. Parapsychologist Ian Stevenson collected more than a thousand of such cases (Stevenson, 2001). And, in a good portion of those cases, children know things about the deceased person that, allegedly, they could not have known otherwise.

However, Stevenson’s work has been severely critiqued for its methodological flaws. In most cases, the child’s family had already made contact with the deceased’s family before Stevenson’s arrival; thus, the child could pick up information and give the impression that he knows more than what he could have known. Paul Edwards has also accused Stevenson of asking leading questions towards his own preconceptions (Edwards, 1997: 14).

Moreover, reincarnation runs into conceptual problems of its own. If you do not remember past lives, then it seems that you cannot legitimately claim that you are the same person whose life you do not remember. However, a few philosophers claim this is not a good objection at all, as you do not remember being a very young child, and yet can still surely claim to be the same person as that child (Ducasse, 1997: 199).

Population growth also seems to be a problem for reincarnation: according to defenders of reincarnation, souls migrate from one body to another. This, in a sense,  presupposes that the number of souls remains stable, as no new souls are created, they only migrate from body to body. Yet, the number of bodies has consistently increased ever since the dawn of mankind. Where, one may ask, were all souls before new bodies came to exist? (Edwards, 1997: 14). Actually, this objection is not so formidable: perhaps souls exist in a disembodied form as they wait for new bodies to come up (D’Souza, 2009: 57).

b. Mediums and Ghostly Apparitions

During the heyday of Spiritualism (the religious movement that sought to make contact with the dead), some mediums gained prominence for their reputed abilities to contact the dead. These mediums were of two kinds: physical mediums invoked spirits that, allegedly, produced physical phenomena (for example, lifting tables); and mental mediums whose bodies, allegedly, were temporarily possessed by the spirits.

Most physical mediums were exposed as frauds by trained magicians. Mental mediums, however, presented more of a challenge for skeptics. During their alleged possession by a deceased person’s spirit, mediums would provide information about the deceased person that, apparently, could not have possibly known. William James was impressed by one such medium, Leonora Piper, and although he remained somewhat skeptical, he finally endorsed the view that Piper in fact made contact with the dead.

Some parapsychologists credit the legitimacy of mental mediumship (Almeder, 1992). However, most scholars believe that mental mediums work through the technique of ‘cold reading’: they ask friends and relatives of a deceased person questions at a fast pace, and infer from their body language and other indicators, information about the deceased person (Gardner, 2003).

Parapsychologists have also gathered testimonies of alleged ghost appearances, especially cases where the spirit communicates something that no person could have known (for example, the location of a hidden treasure), and yet it is corroborated. This evidence seems far too anecdotal to be taken seriously; it does not go through the rigorous control that such a claim would require.

c. Electronic-Voice Phenomena

Some parapsychologists have tried to record white noise generated by vacant radio stations, and in places where it is known that no person is present (Raudive, 1991). Allegedly, some of those recordings have produced noises similar to human voices with strange messages, and these voices are believed to come from ghosts. Skeptics claim that such messages are too vague to be taken seriously, and that the tendency of the human mind to find purpose everywhere, promotes the interpretation of simple noises as human voices.

d. Near-Death Experiences

Ever since ancient times (for example, Plato’s myth of Er in The Republic), there have been reports of people who have lost some vital signs, and yet, regained them after a brief period of time. Some people have claimed to have unique experiences in those moments: an acute noise, a peaceful and relaxed sensation; the feeling of abandoning the body, floating in the air and watching the body from above; a passage thorough a dark tunnel; a bright light at the end of the tunnel; an encounter with friends, relatives, and religious characters; a review of life’s most important moments. These are described as near death experiences (Moody, 2001).

Some parapsychologists claim near death experiences are evidence of life after death, and some sort of window revealing the nature of the afterlife. Skeptical scientists, however, have offered plausible physiological explanations for such experiences. Carl Sagan considered the possibility that near death experiences evoke memories from the moment of birth: the transit through the tunnel would evoke the birth canal, and the sensation of floating in the air would evoke the sensation of floating in amniotic acid during gestation (Sagan, 1980).

There are still other physiological explanations. These experiences can be induced by stimulating certain regions of the brain. In moments of intense crises, the brain releases endorphins, and this may account for the peaceful and relaxed sensation. The experience of going through a tunnel may be due to anoxia (lack of oxygen), or the application of anesthetics containing quetamine. The review of life’s most important moments may be due to the stimulation of neurons in the temporal lobules. Encounters with religious characters may be hallucinations as a result of anoxia (Blackmore, 2002) Some patients that have undergone near death experiences have allegedly provided verifiable information that they had no way to know. Some parapsychologists take this as evidence that patients float through the air during near death experiences and, during the ordeal, they are capable to travel to other locations. This evidence is, however, anecdotal. And there is contrary evidence: Researchers have placed computer laptops with random images in the roof of emergency rooms, so that only someone watching from above could know the content of the images, but, so far, no patient has ever accurately described such images (Roach, 2005).

e. Extrasensory Perception

Parapsychologists have designed some experiments that purport to prove that some people have the ability of extrasensory perception or ESP (Radin, 1997). If this ability does indeed exist, it would not prove immortality, but it would seem to prove dualism; that is, the mind is not reducible to the brain.

The best formulated experiment is the so-called Ganzfeld experiment. Person A relaxes in a cabin, her eyes are covered with ping-pong ball halves, and listens to white noise for fifteen minutes. This is intended to promote sense deprivation. In another cabin, person B is shown a target image. Afterwards, subject A is shown the target image, along with three other images. We should expect a 25% chance probability that subject A will choose the target image, but when experiments are performed, 32% of the time, subject A is successful. Parapsychologists claim this is evidence that something strange is going on (as it defies the expectancy of chance), and their explanation is that some people have the ability of extra sensory perception.

However, this experiment is not without critics. There may be sensory leakage (perhaps the cabins are not sufficiently isolated from each other). The experiment’s protocols have not adequately presented the images in random sequences. And, even if, indeed, the results come out 32% accurate when only 25% is expected by chance, it should not be assumed that a paranormal phenomenon is going on; at most, further research would be required to satisfactorily reach a conclusion.

9. The Technological Prospect of Immortality

Most secular scientists have little patience for parapsychology or religiously-inspired immortality. However, the exponential growth of technological innovation in our era has allowed the possibility to consider that, in a not-too-distant future, bodily immortality may become a reality. A few of these proposed technologies raise philosophical issues.

a. Cryonics

Cryonics is the preservation of corpses in low temperatures. Although it is not a technology that purports to bring persons back to life, it does purport to conserve them until some future technology might be capable of resuscitating dead bodies. If, indeed, such technology were ever developed, we would need to revise the physiological criterion for death. For, if brain death is a physiological point of no return, then bodies that are currently cryogenically preserved and will be brought back to life, were not truly dead after all.

b. Strategies for Engineered Negligible Senescence

Most scientists are skeptical of the prospect of resuscitating already dead people, but some are more enthusiastic about the prospect of indefinitely procrastinating death by stopping the aging processes. Scientist Aubrey De Grey has proposed some strategies for engineered negligible senescence: their goal is to identify the mechanisms accountable for aging, and attempt to stop, or even, reverse them (by, say cell repair) (De Grey and Rae, 2008). Some of these strategies involve genetic manipulation and nanotechnology, and hence they bring forth ethical issues. These strategies also bring concern about the ethics of immortality, that is, is immortality even desirable? (See section 3 of this article).

c. Mind Uploading

Yet other futurists consider that, even if it were not possible to indefinitely suspend the body’s death, it would at least be possible to emulate the brain with artificial intelligence (Kurzweil, 1993; Moravec, 2003). Thus, some scientists have considered the prospect of ‘mind-uploading’, that is, the transfer of the mind’s information to a machine. Hence, even if the organic brain dies, the mind could continue to exist once it is uploaded in a silicon-based machine.

Two crucial philosophical issues are raised by this prospect. First, the field of philosophy of artificial intelligence raises the question: could a machine ever really be conscious? Philosophers who adhere to a functionalist understanding of the mind would agree; but other philosophers would not (Consider Searle’s Chinese Room Argument in Searle, 1998).

Even if we were to claim that a machine could in fact be conscious, the technological prospect of mind uploading raises a second philosophical issue: would an emulation of the brain preserve personal identity? If we adhere to a soul or body criterion of personal identity, we should answer negatively. If we adhere to a psychological criterion of personal identity, then we should answer affirmatively, for the artificial brain would indeed be psychologically continuous with the original person.

10. References and Further Reading

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  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers: Thales to Zeno. Routledge. 1979.
  • Beloff, John. Parapsychology: A Concise History. Palgrave. 1997.
  • Bernstein, Morey. The Search for Bridey Murphy. Doubleday. 1956.
  • Blackmore, Susan. “Near-Death Experiencies”. in Shermer, Michael (Ed.). Skeptic Encyclopedia of Pseudoscience. ABC Clio. 2002, p. 150-155.
  • Blackmore, Susan. Consciousness: A Very Short Introduction. Oxford University Press. 2005.
  • Blum, Deborah. Ghost Hunters: William James and the Search for Scientific Proof of Life After Death. Penguin. 2007.
  • Broad, C.D. “On Survival Without a Body” in Edwards, Paul (Ed.) Immortality. Prometheus. 1997, pp. 276-278.
  • Carter, Matt. Minds and Computers: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Artificial Intelligence. Edinburgh University Press. 2007.
  • Chalmers, David. The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory. Oxford University Press. 1996.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. Person and Object. Routledge. 2002.
  • Churchland, Paul. Neurophilosophy at Work. Cambridge University Press. 2007.
  • Craig. William. Reasonable Faith: Christian Truth and Apologetics. Crossway Books. 2008.
  • Cranston, S.L. and Williams, Carey. Reincarnation: A New Horizon in Science, Religion and Society. Julian Press, 1984.
  • Damasio, Antonio. Descartes’ Error: Emotion, Reason and The Human Brain. Vintage Books. 2006.
  • Damer, T. Edward. Attacking Faulty Reasoning. Cengage Learning. 2008.
  • De Grey, Aubrey and Rae, Michael. Ending Aging: The Rejuvenation Breakthroughs That Could Reverse Human Aging in Our Lifetime. St. Martin's Griffin. 2008
  • Dehaene, Stanislas. The Cognitive Neuroscience of Consciousness. MIT Press. 2002.
  • Dennett, Daniel. Conciousness Explained. Back Bay Books. 1992.
  • Descartes, René. Discourse on Method and Meditations on First Philosophy, Donald A. Cress trans. Hackett Publishing Co 1980.
  • D’Souza, Dinseh. Life After Death. Regnery Publishing. 2009
  • Ducasse, C.J. “Survival as Transmigration” in Edwards, Paul (Ed.). Immortality. Prometheus. 1997, pp. 194-199.
  • Edwards, Paul. “Introduction” in Edwards, Paul (Ed.) Immortality. Prometheus. 1997, pp.1-70
  • Feser, Edward. Philosophy of Mind. Oneworld. 2008.
  • Fischer, John Martin. Our Stories: Essays on Life, Death and Free Will. Oxford University Press. 2009.
  • Flew, Antony. Merely Mortal: Can You Survive Your Own Death? Prometheus. 2000.
  • Frohock, Fred. Lives of the Psychics: The Shared Worlds of Science and Mysticism. University of Chicago Press. 2000
  • Gardner, Martin. Are Universes Thicker Than Blackberries? W.W. Norton. 2003.
  • Garrett, Brian. “Personal Identity” in Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Taylor & Francis. 1998, pp. 320-330.
  • Gazzaniga, Michael. Human. Harper Perennial. 2008.
  • Geach, Peter. “Reincarnation” in Flew, Antony (Ed.). Readings in the Philosophical Problems of Parapsychology. Prometheus. 1987, pp. 320-330.
  • Graham, George. Philosophy of Mind: An Introduction. Wiley Blackwell. 1998.
  • Guiley, Rosemary. The Guinness Encyclopedia of Ghosts and Spirits. Guinness Publishing. 1994.
  • Habermas, Gary and Moreland, J.P. Beyond Death: Exploring the Evidence for Immortality. Wipf & Stock Publishers. 2004.
  • Habermas, Gary. In Defence of Miracles. Inter Varsity Press. 2002.
  • Harman, Gilbert. Thought. Princeton University Press. 1973.
  • Harpur, Tom. Life After Death. McClelland and Stewart. 1991.
  • Hasker, William. The Emergent Self. Cornell University Press. 2001.
  • Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. Wiley-Blackwell. 1978.
  • Henry, John. “Henry James”. Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. 2007.
  • Hick, John. Death and Eternal Life. Westminster John Knox Press. 1994.
  • Hines, Terence. Pseudoscience and the Paranormal: A Critical Examination of the Evidence. Prometheus. 1988.
  • Hospers, John. “Is the Notion of Disembodied Existence Intelligible?” in Edwards, Paul (Ed.). Immortality. Prometheus. 1997, pp. 279-281.
  • Hume, David. A Treatise of Human Nature. Nabu Press. 2010.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Nuvision Publications. 2008.
  • Irwin, Harvey. An Introduction to Parapsychology. MacFarland. 2004.
  • Jordan, Jeff. Pascal’s Wager: Pragmatic Arguments and the Existence of God. Oxford University Press. 2006.
  • Kant, Immanuel. Critique of Practical Reason. Forgotten Books. 1999.
  • Kurzweil, Raymond. Age of Spiritual Machines: When Computers Exceed Human Intelligence. Allen & Unwin. 1999.
  • Kurzweil, Raymond. The Singularity is Near: When Humans Transcend Biology. Viking. 2005.
  • Lamont, Corliss. The Illusion of Immortality. Philosophical Library. 1959.
  • Lewis, James. Encyclopedia of Afterlife Beliefs and Phenomena. Visible Ink. 1995.
  • Locke, John. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. WLC. 2009.
  • Ludemann, Gerd. The Resurrection of Christ: A Historical Enquiry. Prometheus. 2004.
  • Martin, Michael. Atheism: A Philosophical Justification. Temple University Press. 1992.
  • Martin, Raymond and Barresi, John. The Rise and Fall of Soul and Self. Columbia University Press. 2006.
  • Mavrodes, George. “Religion and the Queerness of Morality” in Pojman, Louis (Ed.). Ethical Theory: Classical and Contemporary Readings. 1995.
  • Merricks, Trenton. “There are No Criteria of Identity Over Time.” Noûs 32: 106-124. 1998.
  • Minsky, Marvin. The Emotion Machine: Commonsense Thinking, Artificial Intelligence, and the Future of the Human Mind. Simon & Schuster. 2007.
  • Moody, Raymond. Life After Life. Rider. 2001.
  • Moravec, Hans. Robot: Mere Machine to Transcendent Mind. Oxford University Press. 2003.
  • Noonan, Harold. Personal Identity. Routledge. 2003.
  • Parfit, Derek. Reasons and Persons. Oxford University Press. 1984.
  • Parfit, Derek. “Divided Minds and the Nature of Persons” in Edwards, Paul (Ed.). Immortality. Prometheus. 1997, pp. 308-315.
  • Pascal, Blaise. Pensées. Hackett Publishing. 2005.
  • Perry, John. A Dialogue on Personal Identity and Immortality. Hackett Publishers. 1978.
  • Plato. Phaedo. Forgotten Books. 1959.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Representation and Reality. MIT Press. 1988
  • Radin, Dean. The Conscious Universe: The Scientific Truth of Psychic Phenomena. Harper Edge. 1997.
  • Raudive, Konstantin. Breakthrough: An Amazing Experiment in Electronic Communication with the Dead. Smythe. 1991.
  • Rhine, J.S.B. Extra-Sensory Perception. Forgotten books. 1964.
  • Rist, John. Epicurus: An Introduction. CUP Archive. 1972.
  • Roach, Mary. Spook. W.W. Norton Company. 2005.
  • Rosemberg, John. Thinking Clearly About Death. Hackett Publishing. 1998.
  • Ryle, Gilbert. El concepto de lo mental. Paidos. 2005.
  • Sagan, Carl. Brocca’s Brain. Newsweek Books. 1980.
  • Sclotterbeck, Karl. Living Your Past Lives: The Psychology of Past-Life Regression. Iuniverse. 2003.
  • Searle, John. The Philosophy of Mind. The Teaching Company. 1998.
  • Singer, Peter. How Are We to Live: Ethics in an Age of Self-Interest. Prometheus. 1995.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney. Identity, Cause, and Mind: Philosophical Essays. Oxford University Press. 2003.
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  • Strokes, Douglas. The Nature of Mind: Parapsychology and the Role of Consciousness in the Physical World. Macfarland. 1997.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Evolution of the Soul. Oxford University Press. 1997.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Existence of God. Oxford University Press. 2004.
  • Swinburne, Richard. Is There a God? Oxford University Press. 2010.
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  • Tart, Charles, Huston Smith and Kendra Smith. The End of Materialism: How Evidence of the Paranormal Is Bringing Science and Spirit Together. New Harbinger Publications. 2009
  • Turing, Alan. “Computing Machinery and Intelligence” in Dawkins, Richard (Ed.). The Oxford Book of Modern Science Writing. Oxford University Press. 2008, pp. 305-314.
  • Unamuno, Miguel. Del sentimiento trágico de la vida. Ediciones Akal. 1983.
  • Van Inwagen, Peter. “The Possibility of Resurrection” in Edwards, Paul (Ed). Immortality. Prometheus. 1997 pp. 242-246.
  • Voltaire. “The Soul, Identity and Immortality” in Edwards, Paul (Ed). Immortality. Prometheus. 1997 pp. 141-147.
  • Whasker, William. “Afterlife”. Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (2005 Edition). .
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  • Williams, Bernard. Problems of the Self: Philosophical Papers. 1956-1972. Cambridge University Press. 1976.
  • Wright, N.T. The Resurrection of the Son of God. Fortress Press. 2006.
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Author Information

Gabriel Andrade
La Universidad del Zulia

Plato: Organicism

Organicism is the position that the universe is orderly and alive, much like an organism. According to Plato, the Demiurge creates a living and intelligent universe because life is better than non-life and intelligent life is better than mere life. It is the perfect animal.  In contrast with the Darwinian view that the emergence of life and mind are accidents of evolution, the Timaeus holds that the universe, the world, is necessarily alive and intelligent. And mortal organisms are a microcosm of the great macrocosm.

Although Plato is most famous today for his theory of Forms and for the utopian and elitist political philosophy in his Republic, his later writings Plato promote an organicist cosmology which, prima facie, conflicts with aspects of his theory of Forms and of his signature political philosophy. The organicism is found primarily in the Timaeus, but also in the Philebus, Statesman, and Laws.

Because the Timaeus was the only major dialogue of Plato available in the West during most of the Middle Ages, during much of that period his cosmology was assumed by scholars to represent the mature philosophy of Plato, and when many Medieval philosophers refer to Platonism they mean his organicist cosmology, not his theory of Forms. Despite this, Plato’s organicist cosmology is largely unknown to contemporary philosophers, although many scholars have recently begun to show renewed interest.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Whitehead’s Reading of Plato
    2. Greek Organicism
  2. Plato’s Cosmogony and Cosmology
    1. Creation of the World Animal
    2. The Mortal Organism as Microcosm of the Macrocosm
    3. Creation as Procreation
    4. Emergence of Kosmos from Chaos
  3. Relevance to Plato’s Philosophy
    1. Relevance to Plato’s Aesthetics
    2. Relevance to Plato’s Ethics
    3. Relevance to Plato’s Political Philosophy
    4. Relevance to Plato’s Account of Health and Medicine
    5. Relevance to Plato’s Theory of Forms
  4. Influence of Plato’s Cosmology
    1. Transition to Aristotle’s Organicism
    2. Importance for Contemporary Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

a. Whitehead’s Reading of Plato

In his 1927-28 Gifford Lectures, Whitehead (1978) makes the startling suggestion that Plato’s philosophy is akin to a philosophy of organism. This is surprising to many scholars because Plato’s signature doctrine, the theory of Forms, would seem to be as far removed from a philosophy of organism as possible. On the usual understanding of the theory of Forms, reality is divided into a perfect, eternal, unchanging, world of  Forms or universals, and a separate, finite, imperfect world of perceptible particulars, where the latter is an image of the former and is, in some obscure way, unreal, or less real, than the Forms.  Since living things requires growth and change, and since, according to the theory of Forms, these are mere images of the only genuine realities, the Forms, it would seem there can be no fundamental place for living organisms in Plato’s ontology.

The case for Whitehead’s thesis is based on Plato’s Timaeus, where he  compares the kosmos to a living organism, but also, to a lesser degree, on the Laws, Statesman, Philebus and Critias.   Since the Timaeus is concerned with the temporal world, generally thought to be denigrated by the “other-worldly” Plato, its relevance to Plato’s philosophy has been doubted.   First, the cosmology of the Timaeus is not even presented by Socrates, but by Timaeus, a 5th century Pythagorean.   Second, the Timaeus represents its organicist cosmology as a mere probable story.    Third, although Plato employs myths in most of his dialogues, these are generally combined with discursive argument, but the Timaeus is “myth from beginning to end” (Robin, 1996).   For these reasons, many scholars hold that the Timaeus represents a digression into physical speculations that have more to do with the natural sciences per se than they do with philosophy proper (Taylor, 1928).    Russell (1945) allows that the Timaeus deserves to be studied because it has had such great influence on the history of ideas, but holds that “as philosophy it is unimportant.”  The case is further complicated by the controversy over the longstanding view that the Timaeus is a later period dialogue.  For a discussion of these stylometric and chronological disputes see Kraut (1992), Brandwood (1992), and Meinwald (1992).

It is worth remembering, however, that throughout most of the Middle Ages, the Timaeus was the only Platonic dialogues widely available in the West and most scholars at that time assumed that it represents Plato’s mature views (Knowles, 1989).   Second, the dialogue in the Timaeus appears to take up where that of the Republic leaves off, suggesting that Plato himself saw a continuity between the views in the two works.  It is also worth pointing out that some physicists, such as Heisenberg (1958),  have claimed that the Timaeus provided inspiration for their rejection of the materialism of Democritus in favor of the mathematical forms of Plato and the Pythagoreans (see also Brisson and Meyerstein, 1995).   For these and other reasons, a growing number of scholars have, despite the controversies, begun to return to the Timaeus with renewed philosophical interest (Vlastos, 1975; Ostenfield, 1982; Annas, 1999; Sallis, 1999; Carone, 2000; and so forth.).

b. Greek Organicism

In his introduction to Plato’s works, Cairns (1961)  points out that the Greek view, as far back as we have records, is that the world is orderly and alive.  From this perspective, the failure to appreciate Plato’s organicism is part and parcel of a failure to appreciate Greek organicism more generally. For example, whereas modern scholars view the Milesians as forerunners of modern materialism (Jeans, 1958), the Milesians held that matter is alive (Cornford, 1965; Robin, 1996).  Similarly, Anaximenes did not hold that air is the basis of all things in the same sense, or for the same reasons, that a modern materialist might hold such a view.  He views air as breath and sees air as the basis of all things because he sees the world as a living thing and therefore “wants it to breath” (Robin, 1996; Cornford, 1966). Pythagoras too, who exerted great influence on Plato, saw the world as a living breathing being (Robinson, 1968).    Cornford (1966) notes that Plato’s description in the Timaeus of his world animal as a “well rounded sphere” has been seen by some scholars as the best commentary on Parmenides’ comparison of his One Being to a perfect sphere (raising the possibility of a Parmenidean organicism).    Finally, by stressing that fire is the basis of all things, Heraclitus did not mean that fire is the material out of which all things are made.  His fire is an “ever living” fire (Burnet, 1971).  Similar points could be made about other pre-Socratic philosophers.   The Greek tendency to view the world as a living thing is rooted in the fact that the early Greek notion of nature, physis, was closer in meaning to life than to matter (Cornford, 1965).   This is why, as far back as Hesiod, procreation plays such a prominent role in Greek creation stories, as it does in the Timaeus (Section 2c.).   From this perspective, it is not surprising that Plato develops an organicist cosmology.    It would be surprising if he did not have one.

2. Plato’s Cosmogony and Cosmology

a. Creation of the World Animal

The Timaeus describes the world (kosmos) as a created living being.  The world is created by the “Demiurge  [ho demiourgos]” who follows an “eternal pattern” reminiscent of Plato’s Forms (Carone, 2000).  The materials out of which the kosmos is fashioned are already present.    The eternal patterns or Forms, the Demiurge himself, and the materials, all pre-exist the creation.  Thus, Plato’s Demiurge is not omnipotent, but is more like a craftsman, limited both by the eternal patterns and by the prior matter.  The creative act consists in putting “intelligence in soul and soul in body” in accord with the eternal patterns.  The soul in the Timaeus and Laws is understood as the principle of self-motion.

The pre-existing materials are described as “chaos.”   By “chaos” Plato does not mean the complete absence of order, but a kind of order, perhaps even a mechanical order, opposed to Reason.   This “chaotic” tendency survives the imposition of Form and is always threatening to break out and undermine the rational order of the world.   For this reason Plato’s kosmos exhibits a dynamical quality quite alien to modern thought.

The Demiurge creates a living and intelligent world because life is better than non-life and intelligent life is better than mere life.  It is “the perfect animal.”  In contrast with the Darwinian view that the emergence of life and mind are accidents of evolution, the Timaeus holds that the world is necessarily alive and intelligent.

The Timaeus identifies three different kinds of souls, the rational (eternal) soul, the spirited soul, and the plantlike soul capable of sensation but not of genuine self-motion.   The world-animal possesses the highest and most perfect kind of soul, the rational soul, but it also shares in the two lower types of soul as well.  The world may be the perfect animal, but it is not a perfect being because it possesses the lower types of soul.  The presence of these lower types of soul helps to explain the imperfection in the world.

The Timaeus holds that the world is “solitary.”   The Demiurge only creates one world, not because he is stingy, but because he can only create the best and there can only be one best world.   Since it is solitary, there is nowhere for it to go and nothing for it to perceive.   The perfect-animal has, therefore, no external limbs or sense organs.

The Demiurge gives the world the most suitable shape, that is, it is a sphere with each point on the circumference equidistant from the center.   Since it has no need of sense organs or limbs, it is perfectly smooth.  Although the pre-existing visible body is also a sphere, it turns out that a sphere is also the most suitable choice of shape for the perfect animal (Sect. 4c).  The Demiurge imposes an order on that pre-existing material sphere that makes it suitable for the introduction of a soul.    Thus, Plato does not deny that there are material or mechanical conditions for life and mind.  He only insists that these are subordinated in the world to the more basic rule by reason (McDonough, 1991).

The Demiurge makes the perfect animal in the shape of a sphere since a sphere “is the most like itself of all figures” and that makes for the most beautiful figure.  Unlike the modern view that values are a subjective coloring imposed by the human mind (Putnam, 1990), Plato’s kosmos is intrinsically beautiful and good.   Plato’s science of nature does not seek to strip things of value in order to see them “objectively”, but, rather, to describe the intrinsic values writ large in the perfect visible cosmic organism (Sect. 3a-3c).

The Demiurge puts the soul in the center of the sphere, but it “diffuses” throughout the entire sphere.   The Demiurge synchronizes the two spheres “center to center.”  Thus, Plato distinguishes between the organism’s spiritual center and its bodily center, and holds that these must be made, by the Demiurge, to correspond with each other.  This is an early version of the “correlation thesis” (Putnam, 1981), the view that there must be a correspondence between the mental and material states of the organism.   That which is produced directly by intelligence may only have a teleological explanation, while that caused by matter not controlled by intelligence may have only a physical explanation, but that which is produced by the informing of matter by intelligence admits of both a teleological and a physical explanation.   In that case, the teleological and physical “spheres” must correspond with each other.  The world-animal is One in the sense that it possesses an organic unity by virtue of its central order-imposing soul.

Since the kosmos is a perfect animal,  and since an animal has parts, the world is ”a perfect whole of perfect parts.”   The kosmos is a whole of parts because it “the very image of that whole of which all the animals and their tribes are portions.”  The “whole” of which the kosmos is an image is called “the Form of the Intelligible Animal."

The Form of the Intelligible Animal contains “all intelligible beings, just as this [visible] world contains all other visible creatures.”  The perfect animal must embrace all possible species of “intelligible beings.”   Thus, Plato’s world-animal is actually a whole ecosystem of interrelated animals.    It should not, however, be assumed that the cosmic animal is not also a single organism.   Although the human body is, in one sense, a single organism, it is, in another sense, a whole system of interrelated organisms (the individual cells of the body), which combine to form one more perfect organism.

The view that the Form of the intelligible animal contains all intelligible beings suggests that only animals are intelligible.   Matter as such is not intelligible.  A material thing is only intelligible because it instantiates a Form.  The Timaeus suggests that the total recipe for the instantiation of the Forms is a living organism.  The ideas that only living things are intelligible and that matter per se is unintelligible are foreign to the modern mind.   Nonetheless, Plato sees a close connection between life and intelligibility.

Since there is nothing outside the perfect animal, it exists “in itself.”  Since it exists “in itself,” it is self sufficient in the visible world.  It does depend on the Forms, but it does not depend on anything more basic in the perceptible world.   Since it moves, but is an image of the self-sufficient Forms, it moves in the most self-sufficient way, that is, it is self- moving.   Since there is nothing outside it, it can only move “within its own limits,”  that is, it can only rotate around its own axis.    The circular motion of the perfect animal is the best perceptible image of the perfection and self-sameness of the eternal Forms.

Since the perfect animal is intelligent, it thinks.   Since it is self-moving, it is a self-moving thinker.   Since it is self-sufficient in the visible world, it is, in that realm, absolute spontaneity.   Plato’s characterization of the perfect animal as a “sensible God” expresses the fact that it possesses these divine qualities of self-sufficiency, self movement, and absolute spontaneity deriving from its participation in an eternal pattern.

The Timaeus presents a  complex mathematical account, involving the mixing of various types of being, in various precise proportions, of the creation of the “spherical envelope to the body of the universe,” that is, the heavens.  The more orderly movements of the heavenly bodies are better suited than earthly bodies to represent the eternal patterns, but they are not completely ordered.   In addition to the perfect circular movements of the stars, there is also the less orderly movement of the planets.  Plato distinguishes these as “the same” and “the different.”   Whereas the stars display invariable circular movements, the planets move in diverse manners, a different motion for each of the seven planets.   Thus, the movement of the stars is “undivided,” while that of  the plants is divided into separate diverse motions.   Since the former is superior, the movements of the different are subordinated to those of “the same.”  The entirely regular movement of “the same” is the perfect image of the eternal patterns, while the movement of  “the different” is a manifestation of the imperfect material body of the kosmos.   Nevertheless, since “the different” are in the heavens, they are still much more orderly than the “chaotic” movements of bodies on earth.   Although this account is plainly unbelievable, it sheds light on his concept of an organism and his views about intelligence.

To take one example, Plato invokes the dichotomy of “the same” and “the different” to explain the origins of knowledge and true belief.   Because the soul is composed of both “the same” and “the different,” she is capable of recognizing the sameness or difference in anything that “has being.”  Both knowledge and true opinion achieve truth, for “reason works with equal truth whether she is in the sphere of the diverse or of the same,” but intelligence and knowledge, the work of “the same,” are still superior to true belief, the work of “the different."   Insofar as the heavens display the movements of “the same,” the world animal achieves intelligence and knowledge, but  insofar as “the circle of the diverse” imparts the “intimations of sense” to the soul mere true belief is achieved.    Plato is, in effect, describing a kind of celestial mechanism to explain the origins of the perfect animal’s knowledge on the one hand and true belief on the other.   His view implies that an organism must  be imperfect if it is to have true beliefs about a corporeal world and that these imperfections must be reflected in its “mechanism” of belief.

Because of their perfect circular motions, the heavens are better suited than earthly movements to measure time.    Thus, time is “the moving image of eternity.”  This temporal “image of eternity” is eternal and “moves in accord with number” while eternity itself “rests in unity."  But time is not a representation of just any Form.  It is an image of the Form of the Intelligible Animal.   Since time is measured by the movement of the perfect bodies in the heavens, and since that movement constitutes the life of the perfect animal, time is measured by the movement of the perfect life on display in the heavens, establishing a connection between time and life carried down to Bergson (1983).

b. The Mortal Organism as Microcosm of the Macrocosm

The Demiurge creates the world-animal, but leaves the creation of mortal animals to the "created gods,” by which Plato may mean the earth (female) and the sun (male).  Since the created gods imitate the creator, mortal animals are also copies of the world-animal.   Thus, man is a microcosm of the macrocosm, a view that extends from the pre-Socratics (Robinson, 1968), through Scholastic philosophy (Wulf, 1956) and the Renaissance (Cassirer, 1979), to Leibniz (1968), Wittgenstein (1966), Whitehead (1978), and others.

Although plants and the lesser animals are briefly discussed in the Timaeus, the only mortal organism described in detail is man.  Since imperfections are introduced at each stage of copying, man is less perfect than the cosmic-animal, the lesser animals are less perfect than man, and plants are less perfect than the lesser animals.  This yields a hierarchy of organisms, a “great chain of being,” arranged from the most perfect world-animal at the top to the least perfect organisms at the bottom (Lovejoy, 1964).

Since an ordinary organism is a microcosm of the macrocosm, the structure of a mortal organism parallels that of the macrocosm.  Since the structure of the macrocosm is the structure of the heavens (broadly construed to include the earth at the center of the heavenly spheres), one need not rely on empirical studies of ordinary biological organisms.  Since the Timaeus holds that the archetype of an organism is “writ large” in the heavens, the science of astronomy is the primary guide to the understanding of living things. In this respect, our modern view owes more to Aristotle, who accorded greater dignity to the empirical study of ordinary living things (Hamilton, 1964, p. 32).

Since the macrocosm is a sphere with the airy parts at the periphery and the earth at the center, ordinary organisms also have a spherical structure with the airy parts at the periphery and the heavier elements at the center.   Since an ordinary organism is less perfect than the world animal, its spherical shape is distorted.   Although there are three kinds of souls, these are housed in separate bodily spheres.   The rational, or immortal, soul is located in the sphere of the head.  The two mortal souls are encased in the sphere of the thorax and the sphere of the abdomen.   The division of the mortal soul into two parts is compared with the division of a household into the male and female “quarters.”

The head contains the first principle of life.  The soul is united with the body at its center.  Since Plato uses “marrow” as a general term for the material at the center of a seed, the head contains the brain “marrow” suited to house the most divine soul.  There are other kinds of “marrows” at the centers of the chest and abdomen.    The sphere is the natural shape for an animal because the principle of generation takes the same form as a seed, and most seeds are spherical.  The head is a “seed” that gives birth to immortal thoughts.  The thorax and abdomen are “seeds” that give birth to their own appropriate motions.

The motions in the various organic systems imitate the circular motions of the heavens.   Respiration is compared to “the rotation of a wheel."    Since there can be no vacuum, air taken in at one part forces the air already there to move out of its place, which forces the air further down to move, and so on.  Plato gives a similar account of the circulatory system.  The blood is compelled to move by the action of the heart in the center of the chest.  “[T]he particles of the blood … which are contained within the frame of the animal as in a sort of heaven, are compelled to imitate the motion of the universe.”    The blood circulates around the central heart just as the stars circulate around the central earth.   Similar accounts are given of ingestion and evacuation.   The action of the lungs, heart, and so forth, constitutes the bodily mechanism that implements the organic telos.    In the Phaedo and Laws, Plato compares the Earth, the “true mother of us all,” to an organism with its own circulatory systems of subterranean rivers of water and lava.  The organic model of the heavens is the template for an organic model of the geological structure of the earth.

Since the perfect animal has no limbs or sense organs, “the other six [the non-circular] motions were taken away from him.”  Since there is no eternal pattern for these chaotic motions associated with animal life, they are treated as unintelligible.  There is, for Plato, no science of chaos.  His remarks are consistent with the view that there can be a mechanics of the non-circular bodily motions, but since such a mechanics cannot give the all- important reason for the motion it so does not qualify as a science in Plato’s sense.

Since the rise of the mechanistic world view in the 18th century, it has been impossible for modern thinkers to take Plato’s cosmology seriously.  It cannot, however, be denied that it is a breathtaking vision.   If nothing else, it is a startling reminder how differently ancient thinkers viewed the universe.   According to the Timaeus, we on earth live at the center of one unique perfect cosmic organism, in whose image we have been created, and whose nature and destiny has been ordained by imperceptible transcendent forces from eternity.  When we look up at the night sky, we are not seeing mere physical bodies moving in accord with blind mechanical laws, but, rather, are, quite literally, seeing the radiant airy periphery of that single perfect cosmic life, the image of our own (better) selves, from which we draw our being, our guidance, and our destiny.

Finally, Plato is, in the Timaeus, fashioning important components of our concept of an organism, a concept which survives even when his specific quaint theories, do not.  For example, biologists have noted that animals, especially those, like Plato’s perfect animal, that have no need of external sense organs or limbs, tend towards a spherical shape organized around a center (Buchsbaum, 1957).  Indeed, central state materialism, the modern view that the intelligence is causally traceable to the neural center, is, arguably, a conceptual descendent of Plato’s notion of an organism organized around a center.

c. Creation as Procreation


Whereas in his earlier dialogues Plato had distinguished Forms and perceptible objects, the latter copies of the former,  the Timaeus announces the need to posit yet another kind of being, “the Receptacle,” or “nurse of all generation.”  The Receptacle is like the Forms insofar as it is a “universal nature” and is always “the same,” but it must be “formless” so that it can “take every variety of form.”   The Receptacle is likened to “the mother” of all generation, while “the source or spring” of generation, the Demiurge, is likened to the father.   In the Timaeus, the creation of the world is not a purely intellectual act, but, following the sexual motif in pre-Socratic cosmogony, it is modeled on sexual generation.

Plato’s argument for positing the Receptacle is that since visible objects do not exist in themselves, and since they do not exist in the Forms, they must exist “in another,” and the Receptacle is this “other” in which visible objects exist, that is, the argument for positing the Receptacle is premised on the ontologically  dependent status of visible objects.

Since the perfect motion is circular, generation too moves in a circle.  This is true of the generation of the basic elements, earth, air, fire, and water, out of each other, but it is also true of animal generation.  Since the parents of a certain type only generate offspring of the same type, the cycle of procreation always returns, in a circular movement, to the same point from which it started    It is only in creating a copy of themselves, which then go on to do that same, that mortal creatures partake of the eternal (Essentially the same picture is found in Plato’s Symposium and in Aristotle’s Generation of Animals).  Since the sexual act presupposes the prior existence of the male and female principles, the procreation model also explains why Plato’s Demiurge does not create from nothing.

Plato identifies the Receptacle with space, but also suggests that the basic matters, such as fire, are part of its nature, so it cannot be mere space.   Although Plato admits that it somehow “partakes of the intelligible,” he also states that it “is hardly real” and that we only behold it “as in a dream.”   Despite the importance of this view in the Timaeus, Plato is clearly puzzled, and concludes that the Receptacle is only apprehended by a kind of “spurious reason.”   Given his comparison of the receptacle to the female principle, he may think that visible objects are dependent on “another” in something like the sense in which a foetus is dependent on the mother’s womb.  On the other hand, Plato admits that these are murky waters and it is doubtful that the sexual imagery can be taken literally.

d. Emergence of Kosmos from Chaos

The Western intellectual tradition begins, arguably, with the cosmogony in Hesiod’s Theogony, according to which the world emerges from chaos.  A similar story is found in Plato’s creation story in the Timaeus, where, in the beginning, everything is in “disorder” and any “proportion” between things is accidental.   None of the kinds, such as fire, water, and so forth, exist.  These had to be “first set in order” by God, who then, out of them, creates the cosmic animal.   Since the root meaning of the Greek “kosmos” is orderly arrangement, the Timaeus presents a classic picture of the emergence of order out of chaos.

The doctrine of emergent evolution, associated with Bergson (1983), Alexander (1920), and Morgan (1923), is the view that the laws of nature evolve over time (Nagel, 1979).   Since, in the Timaeus, the laws of nature are not fixed by the conditions in the primordial “chaos,” but only arise, under the supervision of the Demiurge, in a temporal process, Plato’s cosmology appears to anticipate these later views.  Mourelatos (1986) argues that emergentism is present in the later pre-Socratic philosophers.  Although emergentism has been out of fashion for some time, it has recently been enjoying a revival (See Kim, Beckermann, and Flores, 1992; McDonough, 2002; Clayton and Davies, 2006, and so forth).

3. Relevance to Plato’s Philosophy

a. Relevance to Plato’s Aesthetics

Since reason dictates that the best creation is the perfect animal, the living kosmos is the most beautiful created thing.   Since the perfect animal is a combination of soul and body, these must be combined in the right proportion.   The correct proportion of these constitutes the organic unity of the organism.   Thus, the beauty of an organism consists in its organic unity.   Since other mortal organisms are microcosms of the macrocosm, the standard of beauty for a mortal organism is set by the beauty of the kosmos.   The beauty of a human being is, in effect, modeled on the beauty of a world.

There is a link between beauty and pleasure, but pleasure is derivative.  Since beauty is a matter of  rational proportion, a rational person naturally finds the sight of beauty pleasurable.   Thus, a rational person finds a well proportioned organism beautiful, where the relevant proportions include not merely physical proportions but the most basic proportion between body and soul.   Finally, since an organism has an organic unity, rationality, beauty, health and virtue can only occur together.    Thus, Plato’s aesthetics shades into his ethics, his view of medicine, and his conception of philosophy itself.

b. Relevance to Plato’s Ethics

Perhaps the most basic objection to Plato’s ethics is the charge that his view that the Forms are patterns for conduct is empty of content.   What can it mean for a changeable, corporeal, mortal, living creature to imitate a non-living immaterial, eternal, unchanging, abstract object?   Plato’s organicist cosmology addresses this gap in his ethical theory.

Since the kosmos is copied from the Form of the Intelligible Animal, and since man is a microcosm of the macrocosm, there is a kinship between the rational part of man and the cosmic life on display in the heavens.   There is a close link, foreign to the modern mind, between ethics and astronomy (Carone, 2000).  This explains why, in the Theaetetus, Socrates states that the philosopher spends their time “searching the heavens.”

Specifically, the ethical individual must strive to imitate the self-sufficiency of the kosmos.  Since the most fundamental dimension of self-sufficiency is self-movement, the ethical individual must strive to be self-moving (like the heavenly bodies).  Since the eternal soul is the rational soul, not the animal or vegetable soul, the ethical individual aims at the life of self-moving rational contemplation.  Since the highest form of the rational life is the life of philosophy, the ethical life coincides with the life of philosophy.

As self-moving, the ethical individual is not moved by external forces, but by the “laws of destiny.”  One must not interpret this in a modern sense.  Plato’s ethical individual is not a cosmic rebel.   The ethical individual does not have their own individualistic destiny.  Since a mortal living being is a microcosm of the macrocosm, it shares in the single law of destiny of the kosmos.  Socrates had earlier stated the analogous view in the Meno that “all nature is akin.”  There is a harmony between man’s law of destiny and that of the kosmos.   Because of their corrupt bodily nature, human beings have fallen away from their cosmic destiny.   Thus, the fundamental ethical imperative is that human beings must strive to reunite with the universal cosmic life from which they have fallen away, the archetype of which is displayed in the heavens.   The ethical law for man is but a special case of the universal law of destiny that applies to all life in the universe.

The bad life is the unbalanced life.   A life is unbalanced when it falls short of the ideal organic unity.   Thus, evil is a kind of disease of the soul.   Since the body is the inferior partner in the union of soul and body, evil results from the undue influence of the body on the soul  Since body and soul are part of an organic unity, and since the soul does not move without the body and vice versa, the diseases of the soul are diseases of the body and vice versa.  Due regard must be given to the bodily needs, but since the soul is the superior partner in that union, the proper proportion is achieved when the rational soul rules the body.   The recipe for a good life is the same as the recipe for a healthy organism.   Thus, the ethics of the Timaeus shades into an account of health and medicine (Sect. 3c).   Since the ethical individual is the philosopher, the account of all of these shades in to account of the philosopher as well.   The ethical individual, the healthy individual, the beautiful individual, and the philosopher are one and the same.

The cosmology of the Timaeus may also serve to counterbalance the elitism in Plato’s earlier ethical views.  Whereas, in Plato’s middle period dialogues, it is implied that goodness and wisdom are only possible for the best human beings (philosophers), the Timaeus suggests the more egalitarian view that since human life is a microcosm of the macrocosm, ethical salvation is possible for all human beings (Carone, 2000).

Plato’s organicism also suggests a more optimistic view of ethical life than is associated with orthodox Platonism.  Whereas, in Plato’s middle period dialogues, the ethical person is represented to be at the mercy of an evil world, and unlikely to be rewarded for their good efforts, the Timaeus posits a “cosmic mechanism” in which virtue is its own reward (Carone, 2000).   Although Socrates may be victimized by unjust men, the ultimate justice is meted out, not in the human law courts, but in the single universal cosmic life.

On the more negative side, Plato’s celestial organicism does commit him to a kind of astrology:  The Demiurge “assigned to each soul a star, and having there placed them as in a chariot, he … declared to them the laws of destiny.”  Taken literally, this opens Plato to easy caricature, but taken symbolically, as it may well be intended, it is a return to the Pythagorean idea that ethical salvation is achieved, not by setting oneself up in individual opposition to the world, but by reuniting with the cosmic rhythm from which one has fallen away (Allen, 1966).   Although this may look more like a cult or religion to modern thinkers, it is worth noting that it does anticipate the criticism of  the human-centered vision of ethics by the modern “deep ecology” movement (Naess, 1990).

c. Relevance to Plato’s Political Philosophy

Since Plato sees an analogy between the polis and the kosmos (Carone, 2000), and since the kosmos is a living organism, Plato’s concept of organism illuminates his account of the polis.   Just as the kosmos is a combination of Reason (Nous) and Necessity (chaos), so too is the polis.   Just as Demiurge brings the kosmos into being by making the primordial chaos submit to Reason, so too, the Statesman brings the polis into being by making the chaos of human life submit to reason.  Carone (2000) suggests that politics, for Plato, is itself is a synthesis of Reason and Necessity.   It is, in this connection, significant, that in Greek, the word “Demiurge” can mean magistrate (Carone, 2000). See Plato's Political Philosophy.

d. Relevance to Plato’s Account of Health and Medicine

Since an organism is an organic whole, beauty, virtue, wisdom, and health must occur together.   Just as Plato’s organicism issues in an aesthetics and an ethics, it also issues in an account of medicine.   Health is a state of orderly bodily motions induced by the soul, while disease is a state of disorder induced by the chaos of the body.   The diseases of the soul, such as sexual intemperance, are caused by the undue influence of the body on the soul, with the consequence that a person who is foolish is not so voluntarily.

Since an organism is an organic whole, one does not treat the heart in order to cure the person.  One treats the whole person in order to cure the heart.   Since the union of body and soul is fundamental, health requires the correct proportion between them.  Since the enemy of health is the chaos of the body, health is achieved by imitating the rational pattern of the heavens.   Since the heavens are self-moving, that motion is the best which is self-produced.   Thus, a self-imposed “regimen” of rational discipline and gymnastic, including the arts and all philosophy, is the optimal way to manage disease.

Unfortunately, most professors of medicine fail to see that disease is a natural part of life.  Although mortal organisms live within limits, professors of medicine are committed to the impossible task of contravening these limits by external force, medications, surgery, and so forth.  By ignoring an organism’s inherent limits, they fail to respect the inner laws of harmony and proportion in nature.   Just as self-movement is, in general, good, movement caused by some external agency is, in general, bad.   Since an organism is a self-moving rational ordering with its own inherent limits, the best course is to identify the unhealthy habits that have led to the malady and institute a “regimen” to restore the organism to its natural cycles.   In a concession to common sense, however, Plato does allow that intervention by external force may be permissible when the disease is “very dangerous.”

Plato’s view of medicine may seem quaint, but since, on his view, beauty, health, virtue, and wisdom are aspects of (or, perhaps, flow from) a fundamental condition of organic unity, his views on medicine shed light on his aesthetics, ethics, and his conception of philosophy.   Health is, in various Platonic dialogues (Republic 444c-d, Laws, 733e, and so forth.), associated with the philosophical and virtuous life.  The fact that the Timaeus’ recipe for health includes a strong dose of “all philosophy” betokens Plato’s view that health, like wisdom and virtue, are specific states of an organism that derive, and can only derive, from a certain central unifying power of the philosophic soul.

e. Relevance to Plato’s Theory of Forms

Although it may seem that Plato’s organicism is irrelevant to his theory of Forms, or even that it is incompatible with it, it is arguable that it supplements and strengthens the theory of Forms.  The three main tenets of the theory of Forms are that (1) the world of Forms is separate from the world of perceptible objects (the two-world view), (2)  perceptible objects are images or copies of the Forms, and (3)  perceptible objects are unreal or “less real” than the Forms.

With regard to the first thesis, there appears to be a tension between Plato’s organicism and the two-world view.  f the kosmos is perfect and beautiful, not infer that the Forms are not separate from the kosmos but are present in it?   On the other hand, since Aristotle says in the Metaphysics that Plato never abandoned the two-world theory, it is prudent to leave the first thesis unchanged.  Even if Plato’s organicism undercuts some of the original motivations for the two-world view, it does not require its rejection (Sect. 4b).

Although Plato’s organicism does not require a rejection of the second thesis, the view that perceptible objects are images of the Forms, it puts it in a different light. Rather, it suggests that perceptible objects are not images of Forms in the sense in which a photograph is an image of a man, but in something like the sense in which a child is an image of its parents (Sect. 2c).   From this perspective, the orthodox reading of Plato relies on a one-sided view of the image-model and thereby makes Plato’s theory of Forms appear to denigrate the perceptible world more than it really must do (Patterson, 1985).

Plato’s organicism also puts the third thesis, the view that perceptible objects are less real than the Forms, in a new light.   Since most philosophers see the picture of degrees of reality as absurd, Plato’s views are open to easy ridicule.   However, Plato’s organicism suggests that this objection is based on a confusion.     On this view, when Plato states or implies that some items are less real than others, he is arranging them in a hierarchy based on to the degree in which they measure up to a certain ideal of organic unity.  On this scale, a man has more “being” than a tomato because a man has a higher degree of organic unity than a tomato.    That has nothing to do with the absurd view that tomatoes do not exist or that they only exist to a lesser degree.   The view that Plato is committed to these absurd ideas derives from an equivocation of Plato’s notion of “being” (roughly organic unity) with the notion of existence denoted by the existential quantifier.

Rather than being either irrelevant to Plato’s philosophy or incompatible with it, Plato’s organicism provides new interpretations of certain concepts in those theories.   Indeed, it suggests that some of the standard criticisms of Plato’s views are based on equivocations.

4. Influence of Plato’s Cosmology

a. Transition to Aristotle’s Organicism

Although Plato’s organicism does seem to be consistent with a theory of Forms, it does not come without a price for that theory.  The theory of Forms had been posited to act as causes, as standards, and as objects of knowledge (Prior, 1985), and Plato’s organicism does undermine some of the original motivations for the theory of Forms.  For example, Plato’s argument that the Forms are needed as standards requires a depreciation of the perceptible world. If living organisms are not merely an image of perfection and beauty, but are themselves perfect and beautiful, then these can act as intelligible standards and there is no special need to posit another separate world of superior intelligible existence. Similar arguments can be extended to the view that Forms are needed as causes and as objects of knowledge.  If one enriches the perceptible world by populating it with intelligible entities, that is, living organisms possessed of their own internal idea, there is no need to look for intelligible standards, causes, or objects of knowledge, in a separate Platonic realm.  In that case, positing a world of separate Forms is an unnecessary metaphysical hypothesis.  This is precisely the direction taken by Aristotle.

Aristotle follows Plato in speaking of form and matter, but, unlike Plato, he does not separate the form from the perceptible objects. Aristotle holds that what is real are substances, roughly, individual packages of formed matter. However, not just any perceptible entity is a substance.  In the Metaphysics (1032a15-20), Aristotle states that “animals and plants and things of that kind” are substances “if anything is.”   On this view, part of the importance of the Timaeus is that it is intermediary between Plato’s orthodox theory of Forms and Aristotle’s theory substance (Johansen, 2004), a point which is lost if the Timaeus is dismissed as a mere literary work with no philosophical significance.  See Sellars (1967), Furth (1987), and McDonough (2000) for further discussions of Aristotle’s organicism.

b. Importance for Contemporary Philosophy


Since Plato’s organicist cosmology includes many plainly unbelievable views (Russell, 1945), the question arises why modern philosophers should take it seriously. Several important points of importance for contemporary philosophy have emerged.  First, Plato’s organicist cosmology is relevant to the interpretation of his theory of Forms by providing new interpretations of key terms in that pivotal theory, and it may even provide an escape from some of the standard objections of that theory (Sect. 4b). Second, Plato’s organicism is intimately linked to his notion of man as the microcosm, a view which appears again in Whitehead’s process philosophy, Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, and others. Third, Plato’s organicism illuminates his ethical views (Sect. 3.2). Fourth, since Plato conceives of the polis on analogy with an organism, it sheds light on his political philosophy (Sect. 3d). Fifth, Plato’s organicism illuminates his account of health and medicine (Sect. 3d), which, in turn, is the classical inspiration for modern holistic views of health and medicine. Sixth, the concept of an organism as, roughly, a sphere organized around a causal center, of which modern “central state materialism is a conceptual descendent,  traces, arguably, to Plato’s Timaeus (Sect. 2b).  Seventh, the Timaeus deserves to be recognized for its contribution to the history of emergentism, which has again become topical in the philosophy of mind (Sect. 2d). Eighth, Aristotle’s theory of substance bears certain conceptual and historical connections to Plato’s organicism (Sect. 4b).  To the degree that these views are important to contemporary philosophy, and history of philosophy, Plato’s organicism is important as well.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristotle. 1951.  Metaphysics. Trans. W.D. Ross. The Basic Works of Aristotle. Ed.Richard McKeon.  Pp. 689-933.
  • Aristotle.  1953. Generation of Animals. A.L. Peck, Trans. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press & London, England: William Heinemann, Ltd.
  • Plato. 1968. Republic. Trans.,  Alan Bloom. New York and London: Basic Books.
  • Plato. 1969. Apology. Hugh Tredennick, Trans. Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp.3-26.
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Author Information

Richard McDonough
Arium Academy and James Cook University

Mathematical Platonism

Mathematical platonism is any metaphysical account of mathematics that implies mathematical entities exist, that they are abstract, and that they are independent of all our rational activities. For example, a platonist might assert that the number pi exists outside of space and time and has the characteristics it does regardless of any mental or physical activities of human beings. Mathematical platonists are often called "realists," although, strictly speaking, there can be realists who are not platonists because they do not accept the platonist requirement that mathematical entities be abstract.

Mathematical platonism enjoys widespread support and is frequently considered the default metaphysical position with respect to mathematics. This is unsurprising given its extremely natural interpretation of mathematical practice. In particular, mathematical platonism takes at face-value such well known truths as that "there exist" an infinite number of prime numbers, and it provides straightforward explanations of mathematical objectivity and of the differences between mathematical and spatio-temporal entities. Thus arguments for mathematical platonism typically assert that in order for mathematical theories to be true their logical structure must refer to some mathematical entities, that many mathematical theories are indeed objectively true, and that mathematical entities are not constituents of the spatio-temporal realm.

The most common challenge to mathematical platonism argues that mathematical platonism requires an impenetrable metaphysical gap between mathematical entities and human beings. Yet an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make our ability to refer to, have knowledge of, or have justified beliefs concerning mathematical entities completely mysterious. Frege, Quine, and "full-blooded platonism" offer the three most promising responses to this challenge.

Nominalism, logicism, formalism and intuitionism are traditional opponents of mathematical platonism, but these metaphysical theories won't be discussed in detail in the present article.

Table of Contents

  1. What Is Mathematical Platonism?
    1. What Types of Items Count as Mathematical Ontology?
    2. What Is It to Be an Abstract Object or Structure?
    3. What Is It to Be Independent of All Rational Activities?
  2. Arguments for Platonism
    1. The Fregean Argument for Object Platonism
      1. Frege’s Philosophical Project
      2. Frege’s Argument
    2. The Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument
  3. Challenges to Platonism
    1. Non-Platonistic Mathematical Existence
    2. The Epistemological and Referential Challenges to Platonism
  4. Full-Blooded Platonism
  5. Supplement: Frege’s Argument for Arithmetic-Object Platonism
  6. Supplement: Realism, Anti-Nominalism, and Metaphysical Constructivism
    1. Realism
    2. Anti-Nominalism
    3. Metaphysical Constructivism
  7. Supplement: The Epistemological Challenge to Platonism
    1. The Motivating Picture Underwriting the Epistemological Challenge
    2. The Fundamental Question: The Core of the Epistemological Challenge
    3. The fundamental Question: Some Further Details
  8. Supplement: The Referential Challenge to Platonism
    1. Introducing the Referential Challenge
    2. Reference and Permutations
    3. Reference and the Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Suggestions for Further Reading
    2. Other References

1. What Is Mathematical Platonism?

Traditionally, mathematical platonism has referred to a collection of metaphysical accounts of mathematics, where a metaphysical account of mathematics is one that entails theses concerning the existence and fundamental nature of mathematical ontology. In particular, such an account of mathematics is a variety of (mathematical) platonism if and only if it entails some version of the following three Theses:

  1. Existence: Some mathematical ontology exists.
  2. Abstractness: Mathematical ontology is abstract.
  3. Independence: Mathematical ontology is independent of all rational activities, that is, the activities of all rational beings.

In order to understand platonism so conceived, it will be useful to investigate what types of items count as mathematical ontology, what it is to be abstract, and what it is to be independent of all rational activities. Let us address these topics.

a. What Types of Items Count as Mathematical Ontology?

Traditionally, platonists have maintained that the items that are fundamental to mathematical ontology are objects, where an object is, roughly, any item that may fall within the range of the first-order bound variables of an appropriately formalized theory and for which identity conditions can be provided. Section 2 provides an outline of the evolution of this conception of an object. Those readers who are unfamiliar with the terminology "first-order bound variable" can consult Model-Theoretic Conceptions of Logical Consequence. Let us call platonisms that take objects to be the fundamental items of mathematical ontology object platonisms. So, object platonism is the conjunction of three theses: some mathematical objects exist, those mathematical objects are abstract, and those mathematical objects are independent of all rational activities. In the last hundred years or so, object platonisms have been defended by Gottlob Frege [1884, 1893, 1903], Crispin Wright and Bob Hale [Wright 1983], [Hale and Wright 2001], and Neil Tennant [1987, 1997].

Nearly all object platonists recognize that most mathematical objects naturally belong to collections (for example, the real numbers, the sets, the cyclical group of order 20). To borrow terminology from model theory, most mathematical objects are elements of mathematical domains. Consult Model-Theoretic Conceptions of Logical Consequence for details. It is well recognized that the objects in mathematical domains have certain properties and stand in certain relations to one another. These distinctively mathematical properties and relations are also acknowledged by object platonists to be items of mathematical ontology.

More recently, it has become popular to maintain that the items that are fundamental to mathematical ontology are structures rather than objects. Stewart Shapiro [1997, pp. 73-4], a prominent defender of this thesis, offers the following definition of a structure:

I define a system to be a collection of objects with certain relations. … A structure is the abstract form of a system, highlighting the interrelationships among the objects, and ignoring any features of them that do not affect how they relate to other objects in the system.

According to structuralists, mathematics’ subject matter is mathematical structures. Individual mathematical entities (for example, the complex number 1 + 2i) are positions or places in such structures. Controversy exists over precisely what this amounts to. Minimally, there is agreement that the places of structures exhibit a greater dependence on one another than object platonists claim exists between the objects of the mathematical domains to which they are committed. Some structuralists add that the places of structures have only structural properties—properties shared by all systems that exemplify the structure in question—and that the identity of such places is determined by their structural properties. Michael Resnik [1981, p. 530], for example, writes:

In mathematics, I claim, we do not have objects with an "internal" composition arranged in structures, we only have structures. The objects of mathematics, that is, the entities which our mathematical constants and quantifiers denote, are structureless points or positions in structures. As positions in structures, they have no identity or features outside a structure.

An excellent everyday example of a structure is a baseball defense (abstractly construed); such positions as pitcher and shortstop are the places of this structure. Although the pitcher and shortstop of any specific baseball defense (for example, of the Cleveland Indians’ baseball defense during a particular pitch of a particular game) have a complete collection of properties, if one considers these positions as places in the structure "baseball defense," the same is not true. For example, these places do not have a particular height, weight, or shoe size. Indeed, their only properties would seem to be those that reflect their relations to other places in the structure "baseball defense."

Although we might label platonisms of the structural variety structure platonisms, they are more commonly labeled ante rem (or sui generis) structuralisms. This label is borrowed from ante rem universals—universals that exist independently of their instances. Consult Universals for a discussion of ante rem universals. Ante rem structures are typically characterized as ante rem universals that, consequently, exist independently of their instances. As such, ante rem structures are abstract, and are typically taken to exist independently of all rational activities.

b. What Is It to Be an Abstract Object or Structure?

There is no straightforward way of addressing what it is to be an abstract object or structure, because "abstract" is a philosophical term of art. Although its primary uses share something in common—they all contrast abstract items (for example, mathematical entities, propositions, type-individuated linguistic characters, pieces of music, novels, etc.) with concrete, most importantly spatio-temporal, items (for example, electrons, planets, particular copies of novels and performances of pieces of music, etc.)—its precise use varies from philosopher to philosopher. Illuminating discussions of these different uses, the nature of the distinction between abstract and concrete, and the difficulties involved in drawing this distinction—for example, whether my center of gravity/mass is abstract or concrete—can be found in [Burgess and Rosen 1997, §I.A.i.a], [Dummett 1981, Chapter 14], [Hale 1987, Chapter 3] and [Lewis 1986, §1.7].

For our purposes, the best account takes abstract to be a cluster concept, that is, a concept whose application is marked by a collection of other concepts, some of which are more important to its application than others. The most important or central member of the cluster associated with abstract is:

1. non-spatio-temporality: the item does not stand to other items in a collection of relations that would make it a constituent of the spatio-temporal realm.

Non-spatio-temporality does not require an item to stand completely outside of the network of spatio-temporal relations. It is possible, for example, for a non-spatio-temporal entity to stand in spatio-temporal relations that are, non-formally, solely temporal relations—consider, for example, type-individuated games of chess, which came into existence at approximately the time at which people started to play chess. Some philosophers maintain that it is possible for non-spatio-temporal objects to stand in some spatio-temporal relations that are, non-formally, solely spatial relations. Centers of gravity/mass are a possible candidate. Yet, the dominant practice in the philosophy of mathematics literature is to take non-spatio-temporal to have an extension that only includes items that fail to stand in all spatio-temporal relations that are, non-formally, solely spatial relations.

Also fairly central to the cluster associated with abstract are, in order of centrality:

2.  acausality: the item neither exerts a strict causal influence over other items nor does any other item causally influence it in the strict sense, where strict causal relations are those that obtain between, and only between, constituents of the spatio-temporal realm—for example, you can kick a football and cause it (in a strict sense) to move, but you can't kick a number.

3.  eternality: where this could be interpreted as either

3a. omnitemporality: the item exists at all times, or

3b. atemporality: the item exists outside of the network of temporal relations,

4.  changelessness: none of the item’s intrinsic properties change—roughly, an item’s intrinsic properties are those that it has independently of its relationships to other items, and

5. necessary existence: the item could not have failed to exist.

An item is abstract if and only if it has enough of the features in this cluster, where the features had by the item in question must include those that are most central to the cluster.

Differences in the use of "abstract" are best accounted for by observing that different philosophers seek to communicate different constellations of features from this cluster when they apply this term. All philosophers insist that an item have Feature 1 before it may be appropriately labeled "abstract." Philosophers of mathematics invariably mean to convey that mathematical entities have Feature 2 when they claim that mathematical objects or structures are abstract. Indeed, they typically mean to convey that such objects or structures have either Feature 3a or 3b, and Feature 4. Some philosophers of mathematics also mean to convey that mathematical objects or structures have Feature 5.

For cluster concepts, it is common to call those items that have all, or most, of the features in the cluster paradigm cases of the concept in question. With this terminology in place, the content of the Abstractness Thesis, as intended and interpreted by most philosophers of mathematics, is more precisely conveyed by the Abstractness+ Thesis: the mathematical objects or structures that exist are paradigm cases of abstract entities.

c. What Is It to Be Independent of All Rational Activities?

The most common account of the content of "X is independent of Y" is X would exist even if Y did not. Accordingly, when platonists affirm the Independence Thesis, they affirm that their favored mathematical ontology would exist even if there were no rational activities, where the rational activities in question might be mental or physical.

Typically, the Independence Thesis is meant to convey more than indicated above. The Independence Thesis is typically meant to convey, in addition, that mathematical objects or structures would have the features that they in fact have even if there were no rational activities or if there were quite different rational activities to the ones that there in fact are. We exclude these stronger conditions from the formal characterization of "X is independent of Y," because there is an interpretation of the neo-Fregean platonists Bob Hale and Crispin Wright that takes them to maintain that mathematical activities determine the ontological structure of a mathematical realm satisfying the Existence, Abstractness, and Independence Theses, that is, mathematical activities determine how such a mathematical realm is structured into objects, properties, and relations. See, for example, [MacBride 2003]. Athough this interpretation of Hale and Wright is controversial, were someone to advocate such a view, he or she would be advocating a variety of platonism.

2. Arguments for Platonism

Without doubt, it is everyday mathematical activities that motivate people to endorse platonism. Those activities are littered with assertions that, when interpreted in a straightforward way, support the Existence Thesis. For example, we are familiar with saying that there exist an infinite number of prime numbers and that there exist exactly two solutions to the equation x2 ­– 5x + 6 = 0. Moreover, it is an axiom of standard set theories that the empty set exists.

It takes only a little consideration to realize that, if mathematical objects or structures do exist, they are unlikely to be constituents of the spatio-temporal realm. For example, where in the spatio-temporal realm might one locate the empty set, or even the number four—as opposed to collections with four elements? How much does the empty set or the real number p weigh? There appear to be no good answers to these questions. Indeed, to even ask them appears to be to engage in a category mistake. This suggests that the core content of the Abstractness Thesis--that mathematical objects or structures are not constituents of the spatio-temporal realm--is correct.

The standard route to the acceptance of the Independence Thesis utilizes the objectivity of mathematics. It is difficult to deny that “there exist infinitely many prime numbers” and “2 + 2 = 4” are objective truths. Platonists argue—or, more frequently, simply assume—that the best explanation of this objectivity is that mathematical theories have a subject matter that is quite independent of rational beings and their activities. The Independence Thesis is a standard way of articulating the relevant type of independence.

So, it is easy to establish the prima facie plausibility of platonism. Yet it took the genius of Gottlob Frege [1884] to transparently and systematically bring together considerations of this type in favor of platonism’s plausibility. In the very same manuscript, Frege also articulated the most influential argument for platonism. Let us examine this argument.

a. The Fregean Argument for Object Platonism

i. Frege’s Philosophical Project

Frege’s argument for platonism [1884, 1893, 1903] was offered in conjunction with his defense of arithmetic logicism—roughly, the thesis that all arithmetic truths are derivable from general logical laws and definitions. In order to carry out a defense of arithmetic logicism, Frege developed his Begriffsschift [1879]—a formal language designed to be an ideal tool for representing the logical structure of what Frege called thoughts. Contemporary philosophers would call them "propositions," and they are what Frege took to be the primary bearers of truth. The technical details of Frege’s begriffsschift need not concern us; the interested reader can consult the articles on Gottlob Frege and Frege and Language. We need only note that Frege took the logical structure of thoughts to be modeled on the mathematical distinction between a function and an argument.

On the basis of this function-argument understanding of logical structure, Frege incorporated two categories of linguistic expression into his begriffsschift: those that are saturated and those that are not. In contemporary parlance, we call the former singular terms (or proper names in a broad sense) and the latter predicates or quantifier expressions, depending on the types of linguistic expressions that may saturate them. For Frege, the distinction between these two categories of linguistic expression directly reflected a metaphysical distinction within thoughts, which he took to have saturated and unsaturated components. He labeled the saturated components of thoughts "objects" and the unsaturated components "concepts." In so doing, Frege took himself to be making precise the notions of object and concept already embedded in the inferential structure of natural languages.

ii. Frege’s Argument

Formulated succinctly, Frege’s argument for arithmetic-object platonism proceeds as follows:

i. Singular terms referring to natural numbers appear in true simple statements.

ii. It is possible for simple statements with singular terms as components to be true only if the objects to which those singular terms refer exist.


iii. the natural numbers exist.

iv. If the natural numbers exist, they are abstract objects that are independent of all rational activities.


v. the natural numbers are existent abstract objects that are independent of all rational activities, that is, arithmetic-object platonism is true.

In order to more fully understand Frege’s argument, let us make four observations: (a) Frege took natural numbers to be objects, because natural number terms are singular terms, (b) Frege took natural numbers to exist because singular terms referring to them appear in true simple statements—in particular, true identity statements, (c) Frege took natural numbers to be independent of all rational activities, because some thoughts containing them are objective, and (d) Frege took natural numbers to be abstract because they are neither mental nor physical. Observations (a) and (b) are important because they are the heart of Frege’s argument for the Existence Thesis, which, at least if one judges by the proportion of his Grundlagen [1884] that was devoted to establishing it, was of central concern to Frege. Observations (c) and (d) are important because they identify the mechanisms that Frege used to defend the Abstractness and Independence Theses. For further details, consult [Frege 1884, §26 and §61].

Frege’s argument for the thesis that some simple numerical identities are objectively true relies heavily on the fact that such identities allow for the application of natural numbers in representing and reasoning about reality, especially the non-mathematical parts of reality. It is applicability in this sense that Frege took to be the primary reason for judging arithmetic to be a body of objective truths rather than a mere game involving the manipulation of symbols. The interested reader should consult [Frege 1903, §91]. A more detailed formulation of Frege’s argument for arithmetic-object platonism, which incorporates the above observations, can be found below in section 5.

The central core of Frege’s argument for arithmetic-object platonism continues to be taken to be plausible, if not correct, by most contemporary philosophers. Yet its reliance on the category "singular term" presents a problem for extending it to a general argument for object platonism. The difficulty with relying on this category can be recognized once one considers extending Frege’s argument to cover mathematical domains that have more members than do the natural numbers (for example, the real numbers, complex numbers, or sets). Although there is a sense in which many natural languages do contain singular terms that refer to all natural numbers—such natural languages embed a procedure for generating a singular term to refer to any given natural number—the same cannot be said for real numbers, complex numbers, and sets. The sheer size of these domains excludes the possibility that there could be a natural language that includes a singular term for each of their members. There are an uncountable number of members in each such domain. Yet no language with an uncountable number of singular terms could plausibly be taken to be a natural language, at least not if what one means by a natural language is a language that could be spoken by rational beings with the same kinds of cognitive capacities that human beings have.

So, if Frege’s argument, or something like it, is to be used to establish a more wide ranging object platonism, then that argument is either going to have to exploit some category other than singular term or it is going to have to invoke this category differently than how Frege did. Some neo-Fregean platonists such as [Hale and Wright 2001] adopt the second strategy. Central to their approach is the category of possible singular term. [MacBride 2003] contains an excellent summary of their strategy. Yet the more widely adopted strategy has been to give up on singular terms all together and instead take objects to be those items that may fall within the range of first-order bound variables and for which identity conditions can be provided. Much of the impetus for this more popular strategy came from Willard Van Orman Quine. See [1948] for a discussion of the primary clause and [1981, p. 102] for a discussion of the secondary clause. It is worth noting, however, that a similar constraint to the secondary clause can be found in Frege’s writings. See discussions of the so-called Caesar problem in, for example, [Hale and Wright 2001, Chapter 14] and [MacBride 2005, 2006].

b. The Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument

Consideration of the Quinean strategy of taking objects to be those items that may fall within the range of first-order bound variables naturally leads us to a contemporary version of Frege’s argument for the Existence Thesis. This Quine-Putnam indispensability argument (QPIA) can be found scattered throughout Quine’s corpus. See, for example, [1951, 1963, 1981]. Yet nowhere is it developed in systematic detail. Indeed, the argument is given its first methodical treatment in Hilary Putnam’s Philosophy of Logic [1971]. To date, the most extensive sympathetic development of the QPIA is provided by Mark Colyvan [2001]. Those interested in a shorter sympathetic development of this argument should read [Resnik 2005].

The core of the QPIA is the following:

i. We should acknowledge the existence of—or, as Quine and Putnam would prefer to put it, be ontologically committed to—all those entities that are indispensable to our best scientific theories.

ii. Mathematical objects or structures are indispensable to our best scientific theories.


iii. We should acknowledge the existence of—be ontologically committed to—mathematical objects or structures.

Note that this argument’s conclusion is akin to the Existence Thesis. Thus, to use it as an argument for platonism, one needs to combine it with considerations that establish the Abstractness and Independence Theses.

So, what is it for a particular, perhaps single-membered, collection of entities to be indispensable to a given scientific theory? Roughly, it is for those entities to be ineliminable from the theory in question without significantly detracting from the scientific attractiveness of that theory. This characterization of indispensability suffices for noting that, prima facie, mathematical theories are indispensable to many scientific theories, for, prima facie, it is impossible to formulate many such theories—never mind formulate those theories in a scientifically attractive way—without using mathematics.

However, indispensability thesis has been challenged. The most influential challenge was made by Hartry Field [1980]. Informative discussions of the literature relating to this challenge can be found in [Colyvan 2001, Chapter 4] and [Balaguer 1998, Chapter 6].

In order to provide a more precise characterization of indispensability, we will need to investigate the doctrines that Quine and Putnam use to motivate and justify the first premise of the QPIA: naturalism and confirmational holism. Naturalism is the abandonment of the goal of developing a first philosophy. According to naturalism, science is an inquiry into reality that, while fallible and corrigible, is not answerable to any supra-scientific tribunal. Thus, naturalism is the recognition that it is within science itself, and not in some prior philosophy, that reality is to be identified and described. Confirmational holism is the doctrine that theories are confirmed or infirmed as wholes, for, as Quine observes, it is not the case that “each statement, taken in isolation from its fellows, can admit of confirmation or infirmation …, statements … face the tribunal of sense experience not individually but only as a corporate body” [1951, p. 38].

It is easy to see the relationship between naturalism, confirmation holism, and the first premise of the QPIA. Suppose a collection of entities is indispensable to one of our best scientific theories. Then, by confirmational holism, whatever support we have for the truth of that scientific theory is support for the truth of the part of that theory to which the collection of entities in question is indispensable. Further, by naturalism, that part of the theory serves as a guide to reality. Consequently, should the truth of that part of the theory commit us to the existence of the collection of entities in question, we should indeed be committed to the existence of those entities, that is, we should be ontologically committed to those entities.

In light of this, what is needed is a mechanism for assessing whether the truth of some theory or part of some theory commits us to the existence of a particular collection of entities. In response to this need, Quine offers his criterion of ontological commitment: theories, as collections of sentences, are committed to those entities over which the first-order bound variables of the sentences contained within them must range in order for those sentences to be true.

Although Quine’s criterion is relatively simple, it is important that one appropriately grasp its application. One cannot simply read ontological commitments from the surface grammar of ordinary language. For, as Quine [1981, p. 9] explains,

[T]he common man’s ontology is vague and untidy … a fenced ontology is just not implicit in ordinary language. The idea of a boundary between being and nonbeing is a philosophical idea, an idea of technical science in the broad sense.

Rather, what is required is that one first regiment the language in question, that is, cast that language in what Quine calls "canonical notation." Thus,

[W]e can draw explicit ontological lines when desired. We can regiment our notation. … Then it is that we can say the objects assumed are the values of the variables. … Various turns of phrase in ordinary language that seem to invoke novel sorts of objects may disappear under such regimentation. At other points new ontic commitments may emerge. There is room for choice, and one chooses with a view to simplicity in one’s overall system of the world. [Quine 1981, pp. 9-10]

To illustrate, the everyday sentence “I saw a possible job for you” would appear to be ontologically committed to possible jobs. Yet this commitment is seen to be spurious once one appropriately regiments this sentence as “I saw a job advertised that might be suitable for you.”

We now have all of the components needed to understand what it is for a particular collection of entities to be indispensable to a scientific theory. A collection of entities is indispensable to a scientific theory if and only if, when that theory is optimally formulated in canonical notation, the entities in question fall within the range of the first-order bound variables of that theory. Here, optimality of formulation should be assessed by the standards that govern the formulation of scientific theories in general (for example, simplicity, fruitfulness, conservativeness, and so forth).

Now that we understand indispensability, it is worth noting the similarity between the QPIA and Frege’s argument for the Existence Thesis. We observed above that Frege’s argument has two key components: recognition of the applicability of numbers in representing and reasoning about the world as support for the contention that arithmetic statements are true, and a logico-inferential analysis of arithmetic statements that identified natural number terms as singular terms. The QPIA encapsulates directly parallel features: ineliminable applicability to our best scientific theories (that is, indispensability) and Quine’s criterion of ontological commitment. While the language and framework of the QPIA are different from those of Frege’s argument, these arguments are, at their core, identical.

One important difference between these arguments is worth noting, however. Frege’s argument is for the existence of objects; his analysis of natural languages only allows for the categories "object" and "concept." Quine’s criterion of ontological commitment recommends commitment to any entity that falls within the range of the first-order bound variables of any theory that one endorses. While all such entities might be objects, some might be positions or places in structures. As such, the QPIA can be used to defend ante rem structuralism.

3. Challenges to Platonism

a. Non-Platonistic Mathematical Existence

Since the late twentieth century, an increasing number of philosophers of mathematics in the platonic tradition have followed the practice of labeling their accounts of mathematics as "realist" or "realism" rather than "platonist" or "platonism." Roughly, these philosophers take an account of mathematics to be a variety of (mathematical) realism if and only if it entails three theses: some mathematical ontology exists, that mathematical ontology has objective features, and that mathematical ontology is, contains, or provides the semantic values of the components of mathematical theories. Typically, contemporary platonists endorse all three theses, yet there are realists who are not platonists. Normally, this is because these individuals do not endorse the Abstractness Thesis. In addition to non-platonist realists, there are also philosophers of mathematics who accept the Existence Thesis but reject the Independence Thesis. Section 6 below discusses accounts of mathematics that endorse the Existence Thesis, or something very similar, yet reject either the Abstractness Thesis or the Independence Thesis.

b. The Epistemological and Referential Challenges to Platonism

Let us consider the two most common challenges to platonism: the epistemological challenge and the referential challenge. Sections 7 and 8 below contain more detailed, systematic discussions of these challenges.

Proponents of these challenges take endorsement of the Existence, Abstractness and Independence Theses to amount to endorsement of a particular metaphysical account of the relationship between the spatio-temporal and mathematical realms. Specifically, according to this account, there is an impenetrable metaphysical gap between these realms. This gap is constituted by a lack of causal interaction between these realms, which, in turn, is a consequence of mathematical entities being abstract (see [Burgess and Rosen 1997, §I.A.2.a]). Proponents of the epistemological challenge observe that, prima facie, such an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make human beings’ ability to form justified mathematical beliefs and obtain mathematical knowledge completely mysterious. Proponents of the referential challenge, on the other hand, observe that, prima facie, such an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make human beings’ ability to refer to mathematical entities completely mysterious. It is natural to suppose that human beings do have justified mathematical beliefs and mathematical knowledge, for example, that 2 + 2 = 4, and do refer to mathematical entities, for example, when we assert “2 is a prime number.” Moreover, it is natural to suppose that the obtaining of these facts is not completely mysterious. The epistemological and referential challenges are challenges to show that the truth of platonism is compatible with the unmysterious obtaining of these facts.

This raises two questions. Why do proponents of the epistemological challenge maintain that an impenetrable metaphysical gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms would make human beings’ ability to form justified mathematical beliefs and obtain mathematical knowledge completely mysterious? (For readability, we shall drop the qualifier "prima facie" in the remainder of this discussion.) And, why do proponents of the referential challenge insist that such an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make human beings’ ability to refer to mathematical entities completely mysterious?

To answer the first question, consider an imaginary scenario. You are in London, England while the State of the Union address is being given. You are particularly interested in what the U.S. President has to say in this address. So, you look for a place where you can watch the address on television. Unfortunately, the State of the Union address is only being televised on a specialized channel that nobody seems to be watching. You ask a Londoner where you might go to watch the address. She responds, “I’m not sure, but if you stay here with me, I’ll let you know word for word what the President says as he says it.”  You look at her confused. You can find no evidence of devices in the vicinity (for example, television sets, mobile phones, or computers) that could explain her ability to do what she claims she will be able to. You respond, “I don’t see any TVs, radios, computers, or the like. How are you going to know what the President is saying?”

That such a response to this Londoner’s claim would be appropriate is obvious. Further, its aptness supports the contention that you can only legitimately claim knowledge of, or justified beliefs concerning, a complex state of affairs if there is some explanation available for the existence of the type of relationship that would need to exist between you and the complex state of affairs in question in order for you to have the said knowledge or justified beliefs. Indeed, it suggests something further: the only kind of acceptable explanation available for knowledge of, or justified beliefs concerning, a complex state of affairs is one that appeals directly or indirectly to a causal connection between the knower or justified believer and the complex state of affairs in question. You questioned the Londoner precisely because you could see no devices that could put her in causal contact with the President, and the only kind of explanation that you could imagine for her having the knowledge (or justified beliefs) that she was claiming she would have would involve her being in this type of contact with the President.

An impenetrable metaphysical gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms of the type that proponents of the epistemological challenge insist exists if platonism is true would exclude the possibility of causal interaction between human beings, who are inhabitants of the spatio-temporal realm, and mathematical entities, which are inhabitants of the mathematical realm. Consequently, such a gap would exclude the possibility of there being an appropriate explanation of human beings having justified mathematical beliefs and mathematical knowledge. So, the truth of platonism, as conceived by proponents of the epistemological challenge, would make all instances of human beings having justified mathematical beliefs or mathematical knowledge completely mysterious.

Next, consider why proponents of the referential challenge maintain that an impenetrable metaphysical gap between the spatio-temporal and mathematical realms would make human beings’ ability to refer to mathematical entities completely mysterious. Once again, this can be seen by considering an imaginary scenario. Imagine that you meet someone for the first time and realize that you went to the same university at around the same time years ago. You begin to reminisce about your university experiences, and she tells you a story about John Smith, an old friend of hers who was a philosophy major, but who now teaches at a small liberal arts college in Ohio, was married about 6 years ago to a woman named Mary, and has three children. You, too, were friends with a John Smith when you were at the University. You recall that he was a philosophy major, intended to go to graduate school, and that a year or so ago a mutual friend told you that he is now married to a woman named Mary and has three children. You incorrectly draw the conclusion that you shared a friend with this woman while at the University. As a matter of fact, there were two John Smiths who were philosophy majors at the appropriate time, and these individuals' lives have shared similar paths. You were friends with one of these individuals, John Smith1, while she was friends with the other, John Smith2.

Your new acquaintance proceeds to inform you that John and Mary Smith got divorced recently. You form a false belief about your old friend and his wife. What makes her statement and corresponding belief true is that, in it, "John Smith" refers to John Smith2, "Mary Smith" refers to Mary Smith2, John Smith2’s former wife, and John Smith2 and Mary Smith2 stand to a recent time in the triadic relation "x got divorced from y at time t." Your belief is false, however, because, in it, "John Smith" refers to John Smith1, "Mary Smith" refers to Mary Smith1, John Smith1’s wife, and John Smith1 and Mary Smith1 fail to stand to a recent time in the triadic relation "x got divorced from y at time t."

Now, consider why John Smith1 and Mary Smith1 are the referents of your use of "John and Mary Smith" while John Smith2 and Mary Smith2 are the referents of your new acquaintance’s use of this phrase. It is because she causally interacted with John Smith2 while at the University, while you causally interacted with John Smith1. In other words, your respective causal interactions are responsible for your respective uses of the phrase "John and Mary Smith" having different referents.

Reflecting on this case, you might conclude that there must be a specific type of causal relationship between a person and an item if that person is to determinately refer to that item. For example, this case might convince you that, in order for you to use the singular term "two" to refer to the number two, there would need to be a causal relationship between you and the number two. Of course, an impenetrable metaphysical gap between the spatio-temporal realm and the mathematical realm would make such a causal relationship impossible. Consequently, such an impenetrable metaphysical gap would make human beings’ ability to refer to mathematical entities completely mysterious.

4. Full-Blooded Platonism

Of the many responses to the epistemological and referential challenges, the three most promising are (i) Frege’s, as developed in the contemporary neo-Fregean literature, (ii) Quine’s, as developed by defenders of the QPIA, and (iii) a response that is commonly referred to as full-blooded or plenitudinous platonism (FBP). This third response has been most fully articulated by Mark Balaguer [1998] and Stewart Shapiro [1997].

The fundamental idea behind FBP is that it is possible for human beings to have systematically and non-accidentally true beliefs about a platonic mathematical realm—a mathematical realm satisfying the Existence, Abstractness, and Independence Theses—without that realm in any way influencing us or us influencing it. This, in turn, is supposed to be made possible by FBP combining two theses: (a) Schematic Reference: the reference relation between mathematical theories and the mathematical realm is purely schematic, or at least close to purely schematic and (b) Plenitude: the mathematical realm is VERY large. It contains entities that are related to one another in all of the possible ways that entities can be related to one another.

What it is for a reference relation to be purely schematic will be explored later. For now, these theses are best understood in light of FBP’s account of mathematical truth, which, intuitively, relies on two further Theses: (1) Mathematical theories embed collections of constraints on what the ontological structure of a given "part" of the mathematical realm must be in order for the said part to be an appropriate truth-maker for the theory in question. (2) The existence of any such appropriate part of the mathematical realm is sufficient to make the said theory true of that part of that realm. For example, it is well-known that arithmetic characterizes an ω-sequence, a countable-infinite collection of objects that has a distinguished initial object and a successor relation that satisfies the induction principle. Thus, illustrating Thesis 1, any part of the mathematical realm that serves as an appropriate truth-maker for arithmetic must be an ω-sequence. Intuitively, one might think that not just any ω-sequence will do, rather one needs a very specific ω-sequence, that is, the natural numbers. Yet, proponents of FBP deny this intuition. According to them, illustrating Thesis 2, any ω-sequence is an appropriate truth-maker for arithmetic; arithmetic is a body of truths that concerns any ω-sequence in the mathematical realm.

Those familiar with the model theoretic notion of "truth in a model" will recognize the similarities between it and FBP’s conception of truth. (Those who are not can consult Model-Theoretic Conceptions Logical Consequence, where "truth in a model" is called "truth in a structure.") These similarities are not accidental; FBP’s conception of truth is intentionally modeled on this model-theoretic notion. The outstanding feature of model-theoretic consequence is that, in constructing a model for evaluating a semantic sequent (a formal argument), one doesn’t care which specific objects one takes as the domain of discourse of that model, which specific objects or collections of objects one takes as the extension of any predicates that appear in the sequent, or which specific objects one takes as the referents of any singular terms that appear in the sequent. All that matters is that those choices meet the constraints placed on them by the sequent in question. So, for example, if you want to construct a model to show that 'Fa & Ga' does not follow from ‘Fa’ and ‘Gb’, you could take the domain of your model to be the set of natural numbers, assign extensions to the two predicates by requiring Ext(F) = {x: x is even} and Ext(G) = {x: x is odd}, and assign denotations Ref(a) = 2, and Ref(b) = 3. Alternatively, you could take the domain of your model to be {Hillary Clinton, Bill Clinton}, Ext(F) = {Hillary Clinton}, Ext(G) = {Bill Clinton}, Ref(a) = Hillary Clinton, and Ref(b) = Bill Clinton. A reference relation is schematic if and only if, when employing it, there is the same type of freedom concerning which items are the referents of quantifiers, predicates, and singular terms as there is when constructing a model. In model theory, the reference relation is purely schematic. This reference relation is employed largely as-is in Shapiro’s structuralist version of FBP, whereas Balaguer’s version of FBP places a few more constraints on this reference relation. Yet neither Shapiro’s nor Balaguer’s constraints undermine the schematic nature of the reference relation they employ in characterizing their respective FBPs.

By endorsing Thesis 2, proponents of FBP endorse the Schematic Reference Thesis. Moreover, Thesis 2 and the Schematic Reference Thesis distinguish the requirements on mathematical reference (and, consequently, truth) from the requirements on reference to (and, consequently, truth concerning) spatio-temporal entities. As illustrated in section 3 above, the logico-inferential components of beliefs and statements about spatio-temporal entities have specific, unique spatio-temporal entities or collections of spatio-temporal entities as their referents. Thus, the reference relationship between spatio-temporal entities and spatio-temporal beliefs and statements is non-schematic.

FBP’s conception of reference appears to provide it with the resources to undermine the legitimacy of the referential challenge. According to proponents of FBP, in offering their challenge, proponents of the referential challenge illegitimately generalized a feature of the reference relationship between spatio-temporal beliefs and statements, and spatio-temporal entities, that is, its non-schematic character.

So, the Schematic Reference Thesis is at the heart of FBP’s response to the referential challenge. By contrast, the Plenitude Thesis is at the heart of FBP’s response to the epistemological challenge. To see this, consider an arbitrary mathematical theory that places an obtainable collection of constraints on any truth-maker for that theory. If the Plenitude Thesis is true, we can be assured that there is a part of the mathematical realm that will serve as an appropriate truth-maker for this theory because the truth of the Plenitude Thesis amounts to the mathematical realm containing some part that is ontologically structured in precisely the way required by the constraints embedded in the particular mathematical theory in question. So, the Plenitude Thesis ensures that there will be some part of the mathematical realm that will serve as an appropriate truth-maker for any mathematical theory that places an obtainable collection of constraints on its truth-maker(s). Balaguer uses the term "consistent" to pick out those mathematical theories that place obtainable constraints on their truth-maker(s). However, what Balaguer means by this is not, or at least should not be, deductively consistent. The appropriate notion is closer to Shapiro’s [1997] notion of coherent, which is a primitive modeled on set-theoretic satisfiability. Yet, however one states the above truth, it has direct consequences for the epistemological challenge. As Balaguer [1998, pp. 48–9] explains:

If FBP is correct, then all consistent purely mathematical theories truly describe some collection of abstract mathematical objects. Thus, to acquire knowledge of mathematical objects, all we need to do is acquire knowledge that some purely mathematical theory is consistent [.…] But knowledge of the consistency of a mathematical theory … does not require any sort of contact with, or access to, the objects that the theory is about. Thus, the [epistemological challenge has] been answered: We can acquire knowledge of abstract mathematical objects without the aid of any sort of contact with such objects.

5. Supplement: Frege’s Argument for Arithmetic-Object Platonism

Frege’s argument for arithmetic-object platonism proceeds in the following way:

i. The primary logico-inferential role of natural number terms (for example, “one” and “seven”) is reflected in numerical identity statements such as “The number of states in the United States of America is fifty.”

ii. The linguistic expressions on each side of identity statements are singular terms.

Therefore, from (i) and (ii),

iii. In their primary logico-inferential role, natural number terms are singular terms.

Therefore, from (iii) and from Frege’s logico-inferential analysis of the category "object,"

iv. the items referred to by natural number terms (that is, the natural numbers) are members of the logico-inferential category object.

v. Many numerical identity statements (for example, the one mentioned in (i) are true.

vi. An identity statement can be true only if the object referred to by the singular terms on either side of that identity statement exists.

Therefore, from (v) and (vi),

vii. the objects to which natural number terms refer (that is, the natural numbers) exist.

viii. Many arithmetic identities are objective.

ix. The existent components of objective thoughts are independent of all rational activities.

Therefore, from (viii) and (ix),

x. the natural numbers are independent of all rational activities.

xi. Thoughts with mental objects as components are not objective.

Therefore, from (viii) and (xi),

xii. the natural numbers are not mental objects.

xiii. The left hand sides of numerical identity statements of the form given in (i) show that natural numbers are associated with concepts in a specific way.

xiv. No physical objects are associated with concepts in the way that natural numbers are.

Therefore, from (xiii) and (xiv),

xv. The natural numbers are not physical objects.

xvi. Objects that are neither mental nor physical are abstract.

Therefore, from (xi), (xv), and (xvi),

xvii. the natural numbers are abstract objects.

Therefore, from (vii), (x), and (xvii),

xviii. arithmetic object platonism is true.

Return to section 2 where this section is references.

6. Supplement: Realism, Anti-Nominalism, and Metaphysical Constructivism

a. Realism

Since the late twentieth century, an increasing number of philosophers of mathematics who endorse the Existence Thesis, or something very similar, have followed the practice of labeling their accounts of mathematics "realist" or "realism" rather than "platonist" or "platonism," where, roughly, an account of mathematics is a variety of (mathematical) realism if and only if it entails three theses: some mathematical ontology exists, that mathematical ontology has objective features, and that mathematical ontology is, contains, or provides the semantic values of the logico-inferential components of mathematical theories. The influences that motivated individual philosophers to adopt this practice are diverse. In the broadest of terms, however, this practice is the result of the dominance of certain strands of analytic philosophy in the philosophy of mathematics.

In order to see how one important strand contributed to the practice of labeling accounts of mathematics "realist" rather than "platonist," let us explore Quinean frameworks. These are frameworks that embed the doctrines of naturalism and confirmational holism in a little more detail. Two features of such frameworks warrant particular mention.

First, within Quinean frameworks, mathematical knowledge is on a par with empirical knowledge; both mathematical statements and statements about the spatio-temporal realm are confirmed and infirmed by empirical investigation. As such, within Quinean frameworks, neither type of statement is knowable a priori, at least in the traditional sense. Yet nearly all prominent Western thinkers have considered mathematical truths to be knowable a priori. Indeed, according to standard histories of Western thought, this way of thinking about mathematical knowledge dates back at least as far as Plato. So, to reject it is to reject something fundamental to Plato’s thoughts about mathematics. Consequently, accounts of mathematics offered within Quinean frameworks almost invariably reject something fundamental to Plato’s thoughts about mathematics. In light of this, and the historical connotations of the label "platonism," it is not difficult to see why one might want to use an alternate label for such accounts that accept the Existence Thesis (or something very similar).

The second feature of Quinean frameworks that warrants particular mention in regard to the practice of using "realism" rather than "platonism" to label accounts of mathematics is that, within such frameworks, mathematical entities are typically treated and thought about in the same way as the theoretical entities of non-mathematical natural science. In some Quinean frameworks, mathematical entities are simply taken to be theoretical entities. This has led some to worry about other traditional theses concerning mathematics. For example, mathematical entities have traditionally been considered necessary existents, and mathematical truths have been considered to be necessary, while the constituents of the spatio-temporal realm—among them, theoretical entities such as electrons—have been considered to be contingent existents, and truths concerning them have been considered to be contingent. Mark Colyvan [2001] uses his discussion of the QPIA—in particular, the abovementioned similarities between mathematical and theoretical entities—to motivate skepticism about the necessity of mathematical truths and the necessary existence of mathematical entities. Michael Resnik [1997] goes one step further and argues that, within his Quinean framework, the distinction between the abstract and the concrete cannot be drawn in a meaningful way. Of course, if this distinction cannot be drawn in a meaningful way, one cannot legitimately espouse the Abstractness Thesis. Once again, it looks as though we have good reasons for not using the label "platonism" for the kinds of accounts of mathematics offered within Quinean frameworks that accept the Existence Thesis (or something very similar).

b. Anti-Nominalism

Most of the Quinean considerations relevant to the practice of labeling metaphysical accounts of mathematics "realist" rather than "platonist" center on problems with the Abstractness Thesis. In particular, those who purposefully characterize themselves as realists rather than platonists frequently want to deny some important feature or features in the cluster associated with abstract. Frequently, such individuals do not question the Independence Thesis. John Burgess’ qualms about metaphysical accounts of mathematics are broader than this. He takes the primary lesson of Quine’s naturalism to be that investigations into "the ultimate nature of reality" are misguided, for we cannot reach the “God’s eye perspective” that they assume. The only perspective that we (as finite beings situated in the spatio-temporal world, using the best methods available to us, that is, the methods of common sense supplemented by scientific investigation) can obtain is a fallible, limited one that has little to offer concerning the ultimate nature of reality.

Burgess takes it to be clear that both pre-theoretic common sense and science are ontologically committed to mathematical entities. He argues that those who deny this, that is, nominalists, do so because they misguidedly believe that we can obtain a God’s eye perspective and have knowledge concerning the ultimate nature of reality. In a series of manuscripts responding to nominalists—see, for example, [Burgess 1983, 2004] and [Burgess and Rosen 1997, 2005]—Burgess has defended anti-nominalism. Anti-nominalism is, simply, the rejection of nominalism. As such, anti-nominalists endorse ontological commitment to mathematical entities, but refuse to engage in speculation about the metaphysical nature of mathematical entities that goes beyond what can be supported by common sense and science. Burgess is explicit that neither common sense nor science provide support for endorsing the Abstractness Thesis when understood as a thesis about the ultimate nature of reality. Further, given that, at least on one construal, the Independence Thesis is just as much a thesis about the ultimate nature of reality as is the Abstractness Thesis, we may assume that Burgess and his fellow anti-nominalists will be unhappy about endorsing it. Anti-nominalism, then, is another account of mathematics that accepts the Existence Thesis (or something very similar), but which cannot be appropriately labeled "platonism."

c. Metaphysical Constructivism

The final collection of metaphysical accounts of mathematics worth mentioning because of their relationship to, but distinctness from, platonism are those that accept the Existence Thesis—and, in some cases, the Abstractness Thesis—but reject the Independence Thesis. At least three classes of accounts fall into this category. The first accounts are those that take mathematical entities to be constructed mental entities. At some points in his corpus, Alfred Heyting suggests that he takes mathematical entities to have this nature—see, for example, [Heyting 1931]. The second accounts are those that take mathematical entities to be the products of mental or linguistic human activities. Some passages in Paul Ernest’s Social Constructivism ss a Philosophy of Mathematics [1998] suggest that he holds this view of mathematical entities. The third accounts are those that take mathematical entities to be social-institutional entities like the United States Supreme Court or Greenpeace. Rueben Hersh [1997] and Julian Cole [2008, 2009] endorse this type of social-institutional account of mathematics. Although all of these accounts are related to platonism in that they take mathematical entities to exist or they endorse ontological commitment to mathematical entities, none can be appropriately labeled "platonism."

Return to section 3 where this section is referenced.

7. Supplement: The Epistemological Challenge to Platonism

Contemporary versions of the epistemological challenge ,sometimes under the label "the epistemological argument against platonism," can typically be traced back to Paul Benacerraf’s paper "Mathematical Truth" [1973]. In fairness to Frege, however, it should be noted that human beings’ epistemic access to the kind of mathematical realm that platonists take to exist was a central concern in his work. Benacerraf’s paper has inspired much discussion. An overview of which appears in [Balaguer 1998, Chapter 2]. Interestingly, very little of this extensive literature has served to develop the challenge itself in any great detail. Probably the most detailed articulation of some version of the challenge itself can be found in two papers collected in [Field 1989]. The presentation of the challenge provided here is inspired by Hartry Field’s formulation, yet is a little more detailed than his formulation.

The epistemological challenge begins with the observation that an important motivation for platonism is the widely held belief that human beings have mathematical knowledge. One might maintain that it is precisely because we take human beings to have mathematical knowledge that we take mathematical theories to be true. In turn, their truth motivates platonists to take their apparent ontological commitments seriously. Consequently, while all metaphysical accounts of mathematics need to address the prima facie phenomenon of human mathematical knowledge, this task is particularly pressing for platonist accounts, for a failure to account for human beings’ ability to have mathematical knowledge would significantly diminish the attractiveness of any such account. Yet it is precisely this that (typical) proponents of the epistemological challenge doubt the platonists’ ability to account for human beings having mathematical knowledge.

a. The Motivating Picture Underwriting the Epistemological Challenge

In order to understand the doubts of proponents of the epistemological challenge, one must first understand the conception or picture of platonism that motivates them. Note that, in virtue of their endorsement of the Existence, Abstractness, and Independence Theses, platonists take the mathematical realm to be quite distinct from the spatio-temporal realm. The doubts underwriting the epistemological challenge derive their impetus from a particular picture of the metaphysical relationship between these distinct realms.  According to this picture, there is an impenetrable metaphysical gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms. This gap is constituted by the lack of causal interaction between these two realms, which, in turn, is a consequence of mathematical entities being abstract—see [Burgess and Rosen 1997, §I.A.2.a] for further details. Moreover, according to this picture, the metaphysical gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms ensures that features of the mathematical realm are independent of features of the spatio-temporal realm. That is, features of the spatio-temporal realm do not in any way influence or determine features of the mathematical realm and vice versa. At the same time, the gap between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms is more than merely an interactive gap; it is also a gap relating to the types of properties characteristic of the constituents of these two realms. Platonists take mathematical entities to be not only acausal but also non-spatio-temporal, eternal, changeless, and (frequently) necessary existents. Typically, constituents of the spatio-temporal world lack all of these properties.

It is far from clear that the understanding of the metaphysical relationship between the mathematical and spatio-temporal realms outlined in the previous paragraph is shared by self-proclaimed platonists. Yet this conception of that relationship is the one that proponents of the epistemological challenge ascribe to platonists. For the purposes of our discussion of this challenge, let us put to one side all concerns about the legitimacy of this conception of platonism, which, from now on, we shall simply call the motivating picture. The remainder of this section assumes that the motivating picture provides an appropriate conception of platonism and it labels as "platonic" the constituents of realms that are metaphysically isolated from and wholly different from the spatio-temporal realm in the way that the mathematical realm is depicted to be by the motivating picture.

b. The Fundamental Question: The Core of the Epistemological Challenge

Let us make some observations relevant to the doubts that underwrite the epistemological challenge. First, according to the motivating picture, the mathematical realm is that to which pure mathematical beliefs and statements are responsible for their truth or falsity. Such beliefs are about this realm and so are true when, and only when, they are appropriately related to this realm. Second, according to all plausible contemporary accounts of human beings, human beliefs in general, and, hence, human mathematical beliefs in particular, are instantiated in human brains, which are constituents of the spatio-temporal realm. Third, it has been widely acknowledged since ancient times that beliefs or statements that are true purely by accident do not constitute knowledge. Thus, in order for a mathematical belief or statement to be an instance of mathematical knowledge, it must be more than simply true; it must be non-accidentally true.

Let us take a mathematical theory to be a non-trivial, systematic collection of mathematical beliefs. Informally, it is the collection of mathematical beliefs endorsed by that theory. In light of the above observations, in order for a mathematical theory to embed mathematical knowledge, there must be something systematic about the way in which the beliefs in that theory are non-accidentally true.

Thus, according to the motivating picture, in order for a mathematical theory to embed mathematical knowledge, a distinctive, non-accidental and systematic relationship must obtain between two distinct and metaphysically isolated realms. That relationship is that the mathematical realm must make true, in a non-accidental and systematic way, the mathematical beliefs endorsed by the theory in question, which are instantiated in the spatio-temporal realm.

In response to this observation, it is reasonable to ask platonists, "What explanation can be provided of this distinctive, non-accidental and systematic relationship obtaining between the mathematical realm and the spatio-temporal realm?" As Field explains, “there is nothing wrong with supposing that some facts about mathematical entities are just brute facts, but to accept that facts about the relationship between mathematical entities and human beings are brute and inexplicable is another matter entirely” [1989, p. 232]. The above question—which this section will call the fundamental question—is the heart of the epistemological challenge to platonism.

c. The fundamental Question: Some Further Details

Let us make some observations that motivate the fundamental question. First, all human theoretical knowledge requires a distinctive type of non-accidental, systematic relationship to obtain. Second, for at least the vast majority of spatio-temporal theories, the obtaining of this non-accidental, systematic relationship is underwritten by causal interaction between the subject matter of the theory in question and human brains. Third, there is no causal interaction between the constituents of platonic realms and human brains. Fourth, the lack of causal interaction between platonic realms and human brains makes it apparently mysterious that the constituents of such realms could be among the relata of a non-accidental, systematic relationship of the type required for human, theoretical knowledge.

So, the epistemological challenge is motivated by the acausality of mathematical entities. Yet Field’s formulation of the challenge includes considerations that go beyond the acausality of mathematical entities. Our discussion of the motivating picture made it clear that, in virtue of its abstract nature, a platonic mathematical realm is wholly different from the spatio-temporal realm. These differences ensure that not only causal explanations, but also other explanations grounded in features of the spatio-temporal realm, are unavailable to platonists in answering the fundamental question. This fact is non-trivial, for explanations grounded in features of the spatio-temporal realm other than causation do appear in natural science. For examples, see [Batterman 2001]. So, a platonist wanting to answer the fundamental question must highlight a mechanism that is not underwritten by any of the typical features of the spatio-temporal realm.

Now, precisely what type of explanation is being sought by those asking the fundamental question? Proponents of the epistemological challenge insist that the motivating picture makes it mysterious that a certain type of relationship could obtain. Those asking the fundamental question are simply looking for an answer that would dispel their strong sense of mystery with respect to the obtaining of this relationship. A plausible discussion of a mechanism that, like causation, is open to investigation, and thus has the potential for making the obtaining of this relationship less than mysterious, should satisfy them. Further, the discussion in question need not provide all of the details of the said explanation. Indeed, if one considers an analogous question with regard to spatio-temporal knowledge, one sees that the simple recognition of some type of causal interaction between the entities in question and human brains is sufficient to dispel the (hypothetical) sense of mystery in question in this case.

Next ask, "Is the fundamental question legitimate?" That is, should platonists feel the need to answer it? It is reasonable to maintain that they should. Explanations should be available for many types of relationships, including the distinctive, non-accidental and systematic relationship required in order for someone to have knowledge of a complex state of affairs. It is this justified belief that legitimizes the fundamental question. One instance of it is the belief that some type of explanation should be, in principle, available for the obtaining of the specific, non-accidental and systematic relationship required for human mathematical knowledge if this is knowledge of an existent mathematical realm. It is illegitimate to provide a metaphysical account of mathematics that rules out the possibility of such an explanation being available, because it would be contrary to this justified belief. The fundamental question is a challenge to platonists to show that they have not made this illegitimate move.

Return to section 3 where this section is referenced.

8. Supplement: The Referential Challenge to Platonism

In the last century or so, the philosophy of mathematics has been dominated by analytic philosophy. One of the primary insights guiding analytic philosophy is that language serves as a guide to the ontological structure of reality. One consequence of this insight is that analytic philosophers have a tendency to assimilate ontology to those items that are the semantic values of true beliefs or statements, that is, the items in virtue of which true beliefs or statements are true. This assimilation played an important role in both of the arguments for platonism developed in section 2. The relevant language-world relations are embedded in Frege’s logico-inferential analysis of the categories of object and concept and in Quine’s criterion of ontological commitment. This assimilation is at the heart of the referential challenge (to platonism).

a. Introducing the Referential Challenge

Before developing the referential challenge, let us think carefully about the following claim: “Pure mathematical beliefs and statements are about the mathematical realm, and so are true when, and only when, they are appropriately related to this realm.” What precisely is it for a belief or statement to be about something? And, what is the appropriate relationship that must obtain in order for whatever a belief or statement is about to make that belief or statement true? It is natural to suppose that the logico-inferential components of beliefs and statements have semantic values. Beliefs and statements are “about” these semantic values. Beliefs and statements are true when, and only when, these semantic values are related in the way that those beliefs and statements maintain that they are. The formal mathematical theory that theorizes about this appropriate relation is model theory. Moreover, on the basis of the above, it is reasonable to suppose that the semantic values of the logico-inferential components of beliefs and statements are, roughly, set or determined by means of causal interaction between human beings and those semantic values.

Applying these observations to the claim “pure mathematical beliefs and statements are about the mathematical realm, and so are true when, and only when, they are appropriately related to this realm,” we find that it maintains that constituents of a mathematical realm are the semantic values of the logico-inferential components of pure mathematical beliefs and statements. Further, such beliefs and statements are true when, and only when, the appropriate semantic values are related to one another in the way that the said beliefs and statements maintain that they are related—more formally, the way demanded by the model-theoretic notion of truth in a model.

So far, our observations have been easily applicable to the mathematical case. Yet they highlight a problem. How are the appropriate semantic values of the logico-inferential components of pure mathematical beliefs and statements set or determined? If platonists are correct about the metaphysics of the mathematical realm, then no constituent of that realm causally interacts with any human being. Yet it is precisely causal interaction between human beings and the semantic values of beliefs and statements about the spatio-temporal world that is responsible for setting or determining the semantic values of such beliefs and statements. The referential challenge is a challenge to platonists to explain how constituents of a platonic mathematical realm could be set or fixed as the semantic values of human beliefs and statements.

b. Reference and Permutations

Two specific types of observations have been particularly important in conveying the force of the referential challenge. The first is the recognition that a variety of mathematical domains contain non-trivial automorphisms, which means that there is a non-trivial, structure-preserving, one-to-one and onto mapping from the domain to itself. A consequence of such automorphisms is that it is possible to systematically reassign the semantic values of the logico-inferential components of a theory that has such a domain as its subject matter in a way that preserves the truth values of the beliefs or statements of that theory. For example, consider the theory of the group {Z,+}, that is, the group whose elements are the integers  …, -2, -1, 0, 1, 2, … and whose operation is addition. If one takes an integer n to have –n as its semantic value rather than n (that is, ‘2’ refers to -2, ‘-3’ refers to 3, and so forth), then the truth values of the statements or beliefs that constitute this theory would be unaltered.  For example, “2 + 3 = 5” would be true in virtue of -2 + -3 being equal to -5. A similar situation arises for complex analysis if one takes each term of the form ‘a+bi’ to have the complex number a-bi as its semantic value rather than the complex number a+bi.

To see how this sharpens the referential challenge, suppose, perhaps per impossible, that you and your acquaintance each know a person named "John Smith." John Smith1 and John Smith2 are actually indistinguishable on the basis of the properties and relations that you discuss with your new acquaintance. That is, all of the consequences of all of the true statements that your new acquaintance makes about John Smith2 are also true of John Smith1, and all of the consequences of all of the true statements that you make about John Smith1 are also true of John Smith2. Under this supposition, her statements are still true in virtue of her using "John Smith" to refer to John Smith2, and your statements are still true in virtue of you using "John Smith" to refer to John Smith1. Using this as a guide, you might claim that ‘2 + 3 = 5’ should be true in virtue of ‘2’ referring to 2, ‘3’ referring to 3, and ‘5’ referring to 5 rather than in virtue of ‘2’ referring to the number -2, ‘3’ referring to the number -3, and ‘5’ referring to the number -5 as would be allowed by the automorphism mentioned above. One way to put this intuition is that 2, 3, and 5, are the intended semantic values of ‘2’, ‘3’, and ‘5’ and, intuitively, beliefs and statements should be true in virtue of the intended semantic values of their components being appropriately related to one another, not in virtue of other items (for example, -2, -3, and, -5) being so related. Yet, in the absence of any causal interaction between the integers and human beings, what explanation can be provided of ‘2’, ‘3’, and ‘5’ having their intended semantic values rather than some other collection of semantic values that preserves the truth values of arithmetic statements?

c. Reference and the Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem

The sharpening of the referential challenge discussed in the previous section is an informal, mathematical version of Hilary Putnam’s permutation argument. See, for example, [Putnam 1981]. A related model-theoretic sharpening of the referential challenge, also due to Putnam [1983], exploits an important result from mathematical logic: the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem. According to the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem, any first-order theory that has a model has a model whose domain is countable, where a model can be understood, roughly, as a specification of semantic values for the components of the theory. To understand the importance of this result, consider first-order complex analysis and its prima facie intended subject matter, that is, the domain of complex numbers. Prima facie, the intended semantic value of a complex number term of the form ‘a+bi’ is the complex number a+bi. Now, the domain of complex numbers is uncountable. So, according to the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem, it is possible to assign semantic values to terms of the form ‘a+bi’ in a way that preserves the truth values of the beliefs or statements of complex analysis, and which is such that the assigned semantic values are drawn from a countable domain whose ontological structure is quite unlike that of the domain of complex numbers. Indeed, not only the truth of first-order complex analysis, but the truth of all first-order mathematics can be sustained by assigning semantic values drawn from a countable domain to the logico-inferential components of first-order mathematical theories. Since most of mathematics is formulated (or formulable) in a first-order way, we are left with the question, "How, in the absence of causal interaction between human beings and the mathematical realm, can a platonist explain a mathematical term having its intended semantic value rather than an alternate value afforded by the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem?"

Strictly speaking, a platonist could bite a bullet here and simply maintain that there is only one platonic mathematical domain, a countable one, and that this domain is the actual, if not intended, subject matter of most mathematics. Yet this is not a bullet that most platonists want to bite, for they typically want the Existence Thesis to cover not only a countable mathematical domain, but all of the mathematical domains typically theorized about by mathematicians and, frequently, numerous other domains about which human mathematicians have not, as yet, developed theories. As soon as the scope of the Existence Thesis is so extended, the sharpening of the referential challenge underwritten by the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem has force.

Return to section 3 where this section is referenced.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Suggestions for Further Reading

  • Balaguer, Mark 1998. Platonism and Anti-Platonism in Mathematics, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • The first part of this book provides a relatively gentle introduction to full-blooded platonism. It also includes a nice discussion of the literature surrounding the epistemological challenge.
  • Balaguer, Mark 2008. Mathematical Platonism, in Proof and Other Dilemmas: Mathematics and Philosophy, ed. Bonnie Gold and Roger Simons, Washington, DC: Mathematics Association of America: 179–204.
    • This article provides a non-technical introduction to mathematical platonism. It is an excellent source of references relating to the topics addressed in this article.
  • Benacerraf, Paul 1973. Mathematical Truth, Journal of Philosophy 70: 661–79.
    • This paper contains a discussion of the dilemma that motivated contemporary interest in the epistemological challenge to platonism. It is relatively easy to read.
  • Burgess, John and Gideon Rosen 1997. A Subject With No Object: Strategies for Nominalistic Interpretation of Mathematics, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • The majority of this book is devoted to a technical discussion of a variety of strategies for nominalizing mathematics. Yet §1A and §3C contain valuable insights relating to platonism. These sections also provide an interesting discussion of anti-nominalism.
  • Colyvan, Mark 2001. The Indispensability of Mathematics, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This book offers an excellent, systematic exploration of the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument and some of the most important challenges that have been leveled against it. It also discusses a variety of motivations for being a non-platonist realist rather than a platonist.
  • Field, Hartry 1980. Science Without Numbers, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
    • This book contains Field’s classic challenge to the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument. Much of it is rather technical.
  • Frege, Gottlob 1884. Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik: eine logisch-mathematische Untersuchung über den Begriff der Zahl, translated by John Langshaw Austin as The Foundations of Mathematics: A logico-mathematical enquiry into the concept of number, revised 2nd edition 1974, New York, NY: Basil Blackwell.
    • This manuscript is Frege’s original, non-technical, development of his platonist logicism.
  • Hale, Bob and Crispin Wright 2001. The Reason’s Proper Study: Essays towards a Neo-Fregean Philosophy of Mathematics, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This book collects together many of the most important articles from Hale’s and Wright’s defense of neo-Fregean platonism. Its articles vary in difficulty.
  • MacBride, Fraser 2003. Speaking with Shadows: A Study of Neo-Logicism, British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 54: 103–163.
    • This article provides an excellent summary of Hale’s and Wright’s neo-Fregean logicism. It is relatively easy to read.
  • Putnam, Hilary 1971. Philosophy of Logic, New York, NY: Harper Torch Books.
    • This manuscript contains Putnam’s systematic development of the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument.
  • Resnik, Michael 1997. Mathematics as a Science of Patterns, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This book contains Resnik’s development and defense of a non-platonist, realist structuralism. It contains an interesting discussion of some of the problems with drawing the abstract/concrete distinction.
  • Shapiro, Stewart 1997. Philosophy of Mathematics: Structure and Ontology, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This book contains Shapiro’s development and defense of a platonist structuralism. It also offers answers to the epistemological and referential challenges.
  • Shapiro, Stewart 2005. The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
    • This handbook contains excellent articles addressing a variety of topics in the philosophy of mathematics. Many of these articles touch on themes relevant to platonism.

b. Other References

  • Batterman, Robert 2001. The Devil in the Details: Asymptotic Reasoning in Explanation, Reduction, and Emergence, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • Burgess, John 1983. Why I Am Not a Nominalist, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 24: 41–53
  • Burgess, John 2004. Mathematics and Bleak House, Philosophia Mathematica 12: 18–36.
  • Burgess, John and Gideon Rosen 2005. Nominalism Reconsidered, in The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic, ed. Stewart Shapiro, New York, NY: Oxford University Press: 515–35.
  • Cole, Julian 2008. Mathematical Domains: Social Constructs? in Proof and Other Dilemmas: Mathematics and Philosophy, ed. Bonnie Gold and Roger Simons, Washington, DC: Mathematics Association of America: 109–28.
  • Cole, Julian 2009. Creativity, Freedom, and Authority: A New Perspective on the Metaphysics of Mathematics, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 87: 589–608.
  • Dummett, Michael 1981. Frege: Philosophy of Language, 2nd edition, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Ernest, Paul 1998. Social Constructivism as a Philosophy of Mathematics, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Field, Hartry 1989. Realism, Mathematics, and Modality, New York, NY: Basil Blackwell.
  • Frege, Gottlob 1879. Begriffsschift, eine der arithmetschen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens, Halle a. Saale: Verlag von Louis Nebert.
  • Frege, Gottlob 1893. Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, Band 1, Jena, Germany: Verlag von Hermann Pohle.
  • Frege, Gottlob 1903. Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, Band 2, Jena, Germany: Verlag von Hermann Pohle.
  • Hale, Bob 1987. Abstract Objects, New York, NY: Basil Blackwell.
  • Hersh, Rueben 1997. What Is Mathematics, Really? New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • Heyting, Alfred 1931. Die intuitionistische Grundlegung der Mathematik, Erkenntnis 2: 106–115, translated in Paul Benacerraf and Hilary Putnam, Philosophy of Mathematics: Selected Readings, 2nd edition, 1983: 52–61.
  • Lewis, David 1986. On the Plurality of Worlds, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • MacBride, Fraser 2005. The Julio Czsar Problem, Dialectica 59: 223–36.
  • MacBride, Fraser 2006. More problematic than ever: The Julius Caesar objection, in Identity and Modality: New Essays in Metaphysics, ed. Fraser MacBride, New York, NY: Oxford University Press: 174–203.
  • Putnam, Hilary 1981. Reason, Truth, and History, New York, NY: Cambridge University Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary 1983. Realism and Reason, New York, NY: Cambridge University Press.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman 1948. On what there is, Review of Metaphysics 2: 21–38.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman 1951. Two dogmas of empiricism, Philosophical Review 60: 20–43, reprinted in From a Logical Point of View, 2nd edition 1980, New York, NY: Cambridge University Press: 20–46.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman 1963. Set Theory and Its Logic, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Quine, Willard Van Orman 1981. Theories and Things, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Resnik, Michael 1981. Mathematics as a science of patterns: Ontology and reference, Noûs 15: 529–50.
  • Resnik, Michael 2005. Quine and the Web of Belief, in The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic, ed. Stewart Shapiro, New York, NY: Oxford University Press: 412–36.
  • Shapiro, Stewart 1991. Foundations Without Foundationalism: A Case for Second Order Logic, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • Shapiro, Stewart 1993. Modality and ontology, Mind 102: 455–481.
  • Tennant, Neil 1987. Anti-Realism and Logic, New York, NY: Oxford University Press.
  • Tennant, Neil 1997. On the Necessary Existence of Numbers, Noûs 31: 307–36.
  • Wright, Crispin 1983. Frege’s Conception of Numbers as Objects, volume 2 of Scots Philosophical Monograph, Aberdeen, Scotland: Aberdeen University Press.

Author Information

Julian C. Cole
Buffalo State College
U. S. A.

Benedict de Spinoza: Metaphysics

spinozaBaruch (or, in Latin, Benedict) de Spinoza (1632-1677) was one of the most important rationalist philosophers in the early modern period, along with Descartes, Leibniz, and Malebranche.  Spinoza is also the most influential “atheist” in Europe during this period.  “Atheist” at the time meant someone who rejects the traditional Biblical views concerning God and his relation to nature.  In his most important book, titled Ethics Demonstrated in a Geometrical Manner, Spinoza argues for a radically new picture of the universe to rival the traditional Judeo-Christian one.  Using a geometrical method similar to Euclid’s Elements and later Newton’s Principia, he argues that there is no transcendent and personal God, no immortal soul, no free will, and that the universe exists without any ultimate purpose or goal.  Instead, Spinoza argues the whole of the natural world, including human beings, follows one and the same set of natural laws (so, humans are not special), that everything that happens could not have happened differently, that the universe is one inherently active totality (which can be conceived of as either “God” or “Nature”), and that the mind and the body are one and the same thing conceived in two ways.

Spinoza’s Ethics appeared provocative  to his contemporaries.  First, many of them found his arguments clear and compelling.  Spinoza begins Ethics by defining key terms and identifying his assumptions.  Most of these would have seemed commonplace to Spinoza’s contemporaries.  He then derives theorems, which he calls “propositions,”  on the basis of this foundation.  Many of the philosophers and theologians who first read Spinoza’s Ethicsn found these definitions and assumptions unproblematic, but were horrified by the theorems which Spinoza proved on the basis of them.  Second, by all accounts Spinoza was an especially good man who lived a modest and virtuous life. The mere possibility of a “virtuous atheist,” however, severed one of the most popular arguments in favor of traditional Biblical religion: that without it, living a moral life was impossible.

This article examines some fundamental issues of Spinoza’s new “atheistic” metaphysics, and it focuses on three of the most important and difficult aspects of Spinoza’s metaphysics: his theory of substance monism, his theory of attributes, and his theory of conatus.

Table of Contents

  1. The Formal Structure of the Ethics
  2. The Basic Metaphysical Picture: Substance, Attributes, and Modes
  3. Substance Monism
    1. Leibniz’s Objection to Spinoza’s Substance Monism Argument
    2. Why Does the One Substance Have Modes?
  4. Attributes
    1. Subjectivism
    2. Objectivism
    3. Modal Parallelism
  5. Conatus
    1. Conatus and Purposive Action
    2. The Conatus Argument
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Original Language
    2. English Translations
    3. Historical Studies
    4. Philosophical Studies

1. The Formal Structure of the Ethics

The Ethics is broken into five parts:

  1. Of God
  2. Of the Nature and Origin of the Mind
  3. Of the Origin and Nature of the Affects
  4. Of Human Bondage, or the Power of the Affects
  5. Of the Power of the Intellect, or of Human Freedom

Part I concerns issues in general metaphysics (the existence of God, free will, the nature of bodies and minds, etc.) Part II concerns two issues related to the mind: (i) what the mind is and how it relates to the body, and (ii) a general theory of knowledge. In Part III, Spinoza presents his theory of emotions (which he calls “affects”) and a fully deterministic human psychology. In Parts IV and V, Spinoza presents his ethical theory.

Each part of the Ethics is broken into definitions of key terms, axioms (assumptions),
propositions (theorems proven on the basis of the definitions, axioms, and the previous propositions), demonstrations (proofs), corollaries (where Spinoza often draws attention to other claims which can be proven on the basis of his propositions, but which are not part of his main argument), and scholia (where Spinoza breaks out of his rigorous structure to comment, argue, or restate the demonstrated material in a more easily accessible way.)

To this classic geometrical structure, Spinoza adds three additions to the Ethics. (1) Spinoza ends Parts I and IV with appendices. In these appendices he comments on the previous part, clarifies his position, and adds new arguments. (2) In Part II and after proposition 13, Spinoza interrupts his argument to include a short discussion on physics and the laws of motion. This part of the Ethics is sometimes called the “Physical Digression,” “Physical Interlude,” or the “Short Treatise on Bodies.” (3) At the end of Part III Spinoza includes an organized list of the definition of the affects (emotions) as argued for in Part III.

When citing the Ethics begin with the Part number, then use the following shorthand:

a Axiom
d Definition
l Lemma
post. Postulate
p Proposition
c Corollary
d demonstration
s Scholium
exp. Explanation

For example, to cite the demonstration of the 14th proposition of Part III one would write “3p14d.” A number of minor variations exist. Some authors also put an “E” at the beginning of the citation to stand for “Ethics” to distinguish the Ethics from Spinoza’s other book written in a geometrical manner, the Principles of Cartesian Philosophy Demonstrated in a Geometrical Manner (1663). For example, the demonstration of the 14th proposition of Part III is often cited as “E3p14d.” Other scholars mark the part number with Roman numerals, thus citing the proposition as “IIIp14d” or “EIIIp14d.”

So why does Spinoza utilize this cumbersome method of proof in the Ethics? Scholars have given a number of different answers to this question. One common explanation concerns how people thought about science in this period. In the 17th century, mathematics was the paradigmatic science. It was widely admired for offering conclusive and incontrovertible proofs which no rational person (who understood them) could reject. Many philosophers attempted to replicate Euclid’s success in other areas and so found other sciences as conclusive and demonstrable as mathematical science. For example, Hobbes attempted to organize political concepts “geometrically” in his Leviathan. Descartes also considered the possibility of organizing his entire philosophy geometrically in the Second Replies, though he never made a serious attempt to do so.) Spinoza, however, geometrically reorganized the first two books of Descartes’ Principles (along with other original material) in his first published book: Principles of Cartesian Philosophy Demonstrated in a Geometrical Manner (1663).

Other scholars argue that there is a deeper reason for Spinoza’s use of the geometrical method. The goal of the Ethics, Spinoza says, is to prove those things that can “lead us, by the hand, as it were, to the knowledge of the human mind and its highest blessedness” (Preface to Part II). Ethics is supposed to be a philosophical therapy which helps its readers to overcome their passions and superstitions and become more rational. Working through the proofs, Spinoza promotes these goals by forcing us to think carefully, and so promotes the therapeutic aim of his book. For more on the purpose of the geometrical method see Wolfson 1958, I 3-32; Bennett 1988, 16-28; Garrett 2003; Nadler 2006, 35-51.

2. The Basic Metaphysical Picture: Substance, Attributes, and Modes

According to Spinoza, everything that exists is either a substance or a mode (E1a1). A substance is something that needs nothing else in order to exist or be conceived. Substances are independent entities both conceptually and ontologically (E1d3). A mode or property is something that needs a substance in order to exist, and cannot exist without a substance (E1d5). For example, being furry, orange, hungry, angry, etc. are modes that need a substance which is furry, orange, hungry, angry, etc. Hunger and patches of orange color cannot exist floating around on their own, but rather, hunger and patches of orange color need something (namely, a substance) to be hungry and have the orange color. Hunger and colors are, therefore, dependent entities or modes.

According to almost all of Spinoza’s predecessors (including Aristotle and Descartes) there are lots of substances in the universe, each with their own modes or properties. For example, according to Descartes a cat is a substance which has the modes or properties of being furry, orange, soft, etc. (Though some have argued that Descartes cannot actually individuate multiple extended substances. See Curley 1988, 15-19; 141-2 n. 9.) Spinoza, however, rejects this traditional view and argues instead that there is only one substance, called “God” or “Nature.” Cats, dogs, people, rocks, etc. are not substances in Spinoza’s view, but rather, cats, dogs, people, rocks, etc. are just modes or properties of one substance. This one substance is simply people-like in places, rock-like in other places, chair-like in still other places, etc.

One can think of substance as an infinite space. Some regions of this one space are hard and brown (rocks), other regions of space are green, juicy, and soft (plants), while still other regions are furry, orange, and soft (cats), etc. As a cat walks across the room all that happens in Spinoza’s view is that different regions of space become successively furry, orange, and soft (See Bennett 1984: 88-92 for more on space and the extended substance in Spinoza).

This one substance has an infinite number of attributes. An attribute is simply an essence; a “what it is to be” that kind of thing. According to Descartes, every substance has only one attribute: bodies have only the attribute of extension, and minds have only the attribute of thought. Spinoza, however, argues against this claim that the one substance is absolutely infinite and so it must exist in every way that something can exist. Thus, he infers that the one substance must have an infinite number of attributes (E1p9). An attribute, according to Spinoza, is just the essence of substance under some way of conceiving or describing the substance (E1d4). When we consider substance one way, then we conceive of its essence as extension. When we consider substance another way, then we conceive of its essence as thought. (See Della Rocca 1996a: 164-167.) While substance has an infinite number of different attributes, Spinoza argues that human beings only know about two of them: extension and thought.

3. Substance Monism

The most distinctive aspect of Spinoza’s system is his substance monism; that is, his claim that one infinite substance—God or Nature—is the only substance that exists.  His argument for this monism is his first argument in Part I of the Ethics.  The basic structure of the argument is as follows:

  1. Every substance has at least one attribute.  (Premise 1, E1d4)
  2. Two substances cannot share the same nature or attribute.  (Premise 2, E1p5)
  3. God has all possible attributes. (Premise 3, Definition of ‘God’, E1d6)
  4. God exists.  (Premise 4, E1p11)
  5. Therefore, no other substance other than God can exist.  (From 1-4, E1p14)

That is, there is only one substance (called “God” or “Nature”) which has all possible attributes.  No other substance can exist because if it existed it would have to share an attribute with God, but it is impossible for two different substances to both have the same attribute.  Spinoza defends each of his four assumptions as follows:

The Argument for Premise One (E1d4)

If a substance existed which did not have any attributes, then (by Spinoza’s definition of attribute at E1d4) the substance would not have an essence.  However, according to Spinoza, it makes no sense to claim that something exists which does not have an essence.  Thus, every substance has at least one attribute.  This premise is not particularly controversial.

The Argument for Premise Two (E1p5)

Spinoza’s argument for the second premise (“Two substances cannot share the same nature or attribute”) is much more controversial.  Here Spinoza argues that if two substances share one and the same attribute, then there is no way to tell the two substances apart.  If substance A and substance B both have attribute 1 as their nature, then in virtue of what are there two different substances here?  Why aren’t A and B just one substance?  Since no cause can be given to explain their distinctness, Spinoza infers that they must actually be the same.  Formally, the argument is as follows:

  1. Two substances are distinguished from each other either by a difference in attributes or a difference in modes.  (Premise 1)
  2. Substance is prior in nature to its modes.  (Premise 2, E1p1)
  3. If two substances A and B are indistinguishable, then they are identical.  (Premise 3)
  4. If substances A and B differ only in attributes, then A and B are two different substances with different natures.  (From 1 and the definition of “attribute.”)
  5. If substances A and B differ only in modes and share an attribute, and if the modes are put to one side and the substances are considered in themselves, then the two substances would be indistinguishable.  (From 1, 2)
  6. But if substances A and B are indistinguishable, then they are identical. (From 3, 5)
  7. Thus, no two substances can share a nature or attribute.  (From 4, 6)

The Arguments for Premise Four (E1p11)

In the demonstration of E1p11, Spinoza explicitly provides a number of different proofs for the existence of a substance with infinite attributes (namely, God.)  One proof is a version of the Ontological Argument also used by Anselm and Descartes.  Spinoza’s argument is interesting, however, because he provides a very different reason for claiming that the essence of each substance includes existence.  Spinoza’s Ontological Argument, once unpacked, is as follows:

  1. When two things have nothing in common, one cannot be the cause of the other (Premise 1, E1p3).
  2. It is impossible for two substances to have the same attribute (or essence) (Premise 2, E1p5).
  3. Two substances with different attributes have nothing in common (Premise 3,  E1p6d).
  4. Thus, one substance cannot cause another substance to exist (From 1, 2, 3.  E1p6).
  5. Either substances are caused to exist by other substances, or they exist by their own nature (Premise 4, E1p7d).
  6. Thus, substances must exist by their own nature (that is, the essence of a substance must involve existence.) (From 4, 5.  E1p7)

This argument differs from the Ontological Arguments offered by Anselm and Descartes in that (i) Spinoza does not infer the existence of God from the claim that our idea of God involves existence and (ii) Spinoza does not assume that existence is a perfection (and so a property).  Spinoza’s argument, therefore, can avoid some of the more common objections to the Ontological proofs as formulated by Descartes and Anselm.  See Earle 1973a and Earle 1973b for a partial defense of Spinoza’s Ontological Argument.

a. Leibniz’s Objection to Spinoza’s Substance Monism Argument

Spinoza’s Argument for Substance Monism is generally deemed a failure by contemporary philosophers.  There are a number of ways to attack the argument.  The most common way is to reject Spinoza’s second premise (E1p5: “That two substances cannot share the same nature or attribute.”)   One of the most popular arguments against this promise was first presented by Leibniz.  Leibniz argued that whereby it might be impossible for two substances to have all of their attributes in common (because then they would be indistinguishable), it may be possible for two substances to share an attribute and yet differ by each having another attribute that is not shared.  For example, one substance may have attributes A and B and another substance has attributes A and C.  The two substances would be distinguishable because each has an attribute the other lacks, but both substances would nevertheless share an attribute.  This objection was first presented by Leibniz to Spinoza himself.  Though Spinoza did not find the objection persuasive, he never offered an explicit reply.  See Della Rocca 2002: 17-22 for a plausible solution on Spinoza’s behalf based upon the conceptual independence of the attributes.

b. Why Does the One Substance Have Modes?

If Spinoza’s Substance Monism Argument were sound, it would prove that the only substance which exists is God or Nature (a substance with an infinite number of attributes).  But why does this one substance have any finite modes (properties)?  Spinoza provides an answer at E1p16.  Here Spinoza argues that “from the necessity of the divine nature there must follow infinitely many things in infinitely many ways (that is, everything which can fall under an infinite intellect)” (E1p16).  Spinoza argues that the greater something is, the greater the number of properties which follow from its nature or essence.  For example, it follows from the nature of a triangle that it has three sides.  Why do triangles have interior angles of 180 degrees?  Because of the kind of things that they are (that is, because of their essence.)

The greater the essence of the thing, the more properties that follow from it.  God’s essence is the greatest possible essence.  Thus, the greatest possible number of properties (that is, an infinite number) must follow from God’s essence or nature.  Thus, an infinite number of finite modes must follow from the essence of God in just the way that certain properties of triangles (having interior angles of 180 degrees, for example) follow from the essence of a triangle.  Because a triangle’s essence is finite only a finite number of properties follow from it; because God’s essence is infinite an infinite number of properties follow from it.  Human beings, chairs, tables, cats, dogs, trees, etc. are some of the properties that follow from God’s essence or nature.

Spinoza claims that one important consequence of this proof is that modes are properties of substance.  The view that modes are properties of substance has been denied by at least one prominent interpreter of Spinoza (Curley 1988: 31-39).  Curley’s view has, however, proven unpopular (See Carriero 1999; Malamed 2009.)  The dominant interpretation today is that modes are properties of the one substance.

4. Attributes

Spinoza’s theory of the attributes (extension, thought, etc.) is the most original, difficult, and controversial aspect of his metaphysics.  According to Descartes, the attribute of a substance is simply the substance’s essence (Principles I.53.)  Given this definition, Descartes infers that each substance has only one attribute.  Spinoza modifies Descartes’s definition at E1d4 and states that “by attribute I understand what the intellect perceives of a substance as constituting its essence.”  The Latin here is “per attributum intelligo id, quod intellectus de substantia percipit, tanquam ejusdem essentiam constituens.”  Spinoza then claims that the one substance (“God” or “Nature”) has an infinite number of attributes (E1d6.)  A number of scholars have found it hard to understand how one substance could have multiple attributes each one of which is “what the intellect perceives … as constituting its essence.”  Either Spinoza is claiming that the one substance has multiple essences, or that the attributes are not really the essence of the substance but only seem to be.

The interpretive problems with Spinoza’s theory of attributes begin with his definition.  In the definition he uses the word ‘tanquam’ which can be correctly translated into English both as ‘as if’ and as ‘as.’  If ‘tanquam’ is translated as ‘as if’, then that translation suggests that the attributes are not really the essence of substance but only seem to be the essence of substance.  If, however, ‘tanquam’ is translated as ‘as’, then that translation would seem to indicate that each attribute really is the essence of substance.  The problem is then to explain how we can have one substance with more than one essence.  Thus, the first problem with Spinoza’s theory of attributes is to explain the relation between the attributes and the essence of substance.

According to some scholars (often called “subjectivists”) each attribute is not really the essence of substance but merely seems to be.  According to these scholars, substance’s essence is in some way “hidden” from the intellect and “unthinkable.”  All we can know is how the essence of the one substance appears to the intellect (either as extension or as thought.)  According to other scholars (often called “objectivists”) each attribute really is the essence of substance.  The problem is then to explain how one substance can have multiple essences and still remain one substance.

The second problem with Spinoza’s theory of attributes is to explain how the attributes are related to one other.  If each attribute really is the essence of the one substance, then how do they relate to each other?  Are they identical?  Or is each attribute really different from every other attribute?  If they are identical, then why does the intellect distinguish them?  If they are different, then how can one substance have more than one essence?  Some subjectivists (such as Wolfson 1958: 142 ff.) argue that there is really only one attribute which is distinguished wrongly into numerous attributes by the intellect.  Objectivists, on the other hand, argue that there is more than one attribute and that they are really distinct from each other.

In summary, there are two major problems with Spinoza’s theory of attributes:

  1. The Attribute-Essence Problem:  How do the attributes relate to the essence of substance?  Are they identical to the essence of substance or distinct?
  2. The Attribute-Attribute Problem:  How do the attributes relate to each other?  Are they identical or distinct?

a. Subjectivism

The most influential defense of the “Subjectivist” interpretation of the attributes is presented by Wolfson 1958 Vol. 1: 142-157.  Wolfson argues that

the two attributes appear to the mind as being distinct from each other.  In reality, however, they are one.  For by [E1p10], attributes, like substance, are summa genera (“conceived through itself”.)  The two attributes must therefore be one and identical with substance.  Furthermore, the two attributes have not been acquired by substance after it had been without them, nor are they conceived by the mind one after the other or deduced one from the other.  They have always been in substance together, and are conceived by our mind simultaneously.  Hence, the attributes are only different words expressing the same reality and being of substance (Wolfson 1958 Vol. 1: 156.)

That is, substance has only one essence and that essence is the sum total of all of its attributes.  The attributes are all identical (and also identical with the substance itself).  The attributes are distinguished from one another merely conceptually (“only different words expressing the same reality”), but in reality the attributes are all one and the same.  The essence of substance is therefore the one attribute extension-thought-etc.  This one attribute cannot be thought as it is, but is instead mentally broken into pieces and considered only partially.  Wolfson thus explicitly provides answers to both the Attribute-Essence Problem and to the Attribute-Attribute Problem.  In both cases Wolfson claims that the relation is identity.  Each attribute is identical to every other attribute (in reality, there is only one “super attribute”) and the essence of substance is this one unthinkable “super attribute.”  Wolfson goes further, however, and also argues that substance is identical to this one unthinkable “super attribute.”

A very different theory of attributes, which also goes by the name of “Subjectivism,” is offered by Bennett.  Bennett argues that the attributes do not constitute the essence of substance at all.  Instead the essence of substance is really the infinite series of finite modes.  The attributes merely appear to constitute the essence of substance.  Bennett disagrees with Wolfson in that Bennett believes “that Nature really has extension and thought, which really are distinct from one another, but that they are not really fundamental properties, although they must be perceived as such by any intellect” (Bennett 1984: 147.)  Thus, Bennett’s solution to the Attribute-Essence Problem is to claim that the essence and attributes are distinct.  But he differs from Wolfson in regard to the Attribute-Attribute Problem.  Here Bennett argues that the attributes are not identical (as Wolfson claims.)

One thing to note here is the looseness of the term “Subjectivism.”  Both Bennett and Wolfson are considered “Subjectivists” because they each deny at least one of the following two claims:

  1. The attributes are really distinct.
  2. The attributes constitute the essence of substance.

Wolfson denies both; Bennett denies only the second.

b. Objectivism

There are significant problems with both Wolfson’s and Bennett’s “Subjectivism.”  The problem is that there is strong textual evidence in favor of the two claims:

  1. The attributes are really distinct.
  2. The attributes constitute the essence of substance.

The argument in favor of (i) is that Spinoza claims at E1p10d that all intellects can conceive of the attributes as really distinct (that is, one without the help of the other.)  Thus, even the infinite intellect (that is, God’s Mind) must conceive of the attributes as really distinct.  But the infinite intellect understands everything exactly as it is
(E1p32).  Therefore, the attributes must be really distinct.  This argument has persuaded almost all recent scholars that (i) is true.

The argument in favor of (ii) also relies on the infinite intellect.  Spinoza claims at E2p3 that the infinite intellect has an adequate and true idea of God’s essence.  But on both Wolfson’s and Bennett’s subjectivist accounts that is not true.  On Wolfson’s account the infinite intellect cannot have an adequate idea of the one “super attribute” extension-thought-etc.  The infinite intellect can only have an idea of the different fragmented pieces, namely, extension, thought, etc.  On Bennett’s account the essence of substance isn’t even an attribute.  Both scholars have to admit that the infinite intellect does not have an adequate idea of the essence of substance, which contradicts Spinoza’s claim at E2p3.  See Della Rocca 1996a: 157-171 for more on the case against Subjectivism.

If both claims (i) and (ii) are true on Spinoza’s view, then the attributes are really distinct, and yet each one constitutes the essence of substance.  This is a significant problem.  How can there be only one substance if this substance has multiple distinct essences?  Edwin Curley answers this question by claiming both that “the attributes of substance satisfy the definition of substance” (Curley 1988: 29) and that the attributes come together to form one essence because “this particular complex is a complex of very special elements” (Curley 1988: 30.)  The attributes on Curley’s view are a collection of an infinite number of substances that come together in much the same way that numbers come together to form a number line.  The number line is a unity composed of an infinite amount of very special elements.

Thus, Curley’s solution to the Attribute-Essence Problem is to claim that each attribute pertains to the essence of substance.  Concerning the Attribute-Attribute Problem, Curley claims that the attributes are really distinct from each other.  A similar view may also have been held by Gueroult 1968 Vol. 1.  Objectivism is often characterized by three theses:

  1. The attributes are really distinct.
  2. The attributes constitute the essence of substance.
  3. The attributes are substances.

The third claim, however, has been disputed by some more recent Objectivists.  Della Rocca in his 1996 book Representation and the Mind-Body Problem in Spinoza offers what is currently the most influential objectivist interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of the attributes.  Della Roccca accepts claims (i) and (ii), but rejects the idea that attributes are themselves substances.  Della Rocca’s interpretation centers on the idea of “referential opacity.”  Della Rocca claims that “a context is referentially opaque if the truth value of the sentence resulting from completing the context does depend on which particular term is used to refer to that object” (Della Rocca 1996a, 122.)  That is, the truth value of a particular sentence depends upon how the objects in the sentence are described.  If the description changes, then the truth value of the sentence may change too.  For example, consider the morning star and the evening star.  The following sentence is true:  Bob believes that the morning star rises in the morning.  However, if you replace ‘the morning star’ without another equally correct description of the same object, then the sentence turns out false.  Because Bob does not know that the morning star and evening star are actually the same thing (namely, Venus) the following sentence is false:  Bob believes that the evening star rises in the morning.  Because the truth-value of the sentence depends upon the description of Venus used in the sentence, this context is referentially opaque.

Della Rocca provides the example of a spy.  One may know that there is a spy in the community and even hate this spy, without knowing that the spy is one’s brother.  In this case the truth-value of sentences such as I hate the spy, I believe that the spy is a spy, etc. all depend upon the term used to pick out the spy.  If we replace ‘the spy’ with the term ‘my brother,’ the truth value of these two sentences changes:  I hate my brother, I believe that my brother is a spy.  Because the truth-value changes when the term used to pick out the person changes, these contexts are referentially opaque.

Della Rocca believes that referential opacity is the key to understanding Spinoza’s theory of attributes.  The idea here is to understand that attribute contexts are referentially opaque.  So, the sentence “the essence of substance is thought” and the sentence “the essence of substance is extension” are referentially opaque contexts.  Della Rocca claims that Spinoza’s definition of attribute should be interpreted as saying: “by attribute I understand that which constitutes the essence of a substance under some description or way of conceiving that substance” (Della Rocca 1996a, 166.)  When substance is considered in one way, then the essence of substance is thought; when substance is considered in another way, then the essence of substance is extension.  What the essence of substance is taken to be will depend upon how the substance is being considered.

By arguing that attribute contexts are referentially opaque, Della Rocca believes that he can avoid the central problem of Subjectivism:  the claim that God misunderstands his own essence (contra E2p3).  Thus, though Della Rocca’s view may at first sound like a form of Subjectivism, it avoids the central problem.  The attributes are really distinct on Della Rocca’s interpretation in that each attribute is the essence of substance under some description of that substance: each really distinct description gives one a different essence.  The attributes also constitute the essence of substance on this view, so long as we add the phrase “under some description or way of conceiving of that substance” to the end.  Della Rocca, however, does not have to accept that attributes are themselves substances.  An attribute is not a substance according to this view (contra Curley); an attribute is simply the essence of a substance under some description or way of conceiving of that substance.

c. Modal Parallelism

How one interprets Spinoza’s theory of attributes will significantly affect the rest of his metaphysics.  For example, one of Spinoza’s most important claims is that “the order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things” (E2p7.)  That is, the order of modes under the attribute of extension is the same as the order of modes under the attribute of thought.  Spinoza explains this idea in an important and controversial scholium.  He claims that

a circle existing in nature and the idea of the existing circle, which is also in God, are one and the same thing, which is explained through different attributes.  Therefore, whether we conceive nature under the attribute of Extension, or under the attribute of Thought, or under any other attribute, we shall find one and the same order, or one and the same connection of causes, i.e., that the same things follow one another (E2p7s.)

The view that one and the same order exists under each of the attributes is called ‘modal parallelism.’  The word ‘parallelism’ is used because not all scholars believe that the relationship between a body and the mind of that body is identity.  How one interprets modal parallelism in Spinoza will depend upon one’s interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of the attributes.  Two of the most developed and influential recent interpretations of Spinoza’s parallelism are Bennett 1984 (who argues that the mind and body are not identical) and Della Rocca 1996a (who argues that the mind and body are identical).

Bennett and others reject the numerical identity interpretation of parallelism on the grounds that it commits Spinoza to a contradiction.  Spinoza claims that there is no causal interaction between minds and bodies at E3p2.  If he then claimed (so the argument goes) that minds and bodies are identical, then he would seemingly be committed to the following contradiction:  if mind M causally interacts with mind N and body 1 is identical with mind M, then it seems as though body 1 must also causally interact with mind N (thus violating Spinoza’s explicit claims at E3p2.)  This argument is presented by both Bennett 1984, 141 and Delahunty 1985, 197 to argue against the identity of minds and bodies in Spinoza.

But Spinoza does say that the mind and the body are “one and the same thing” conceived in two ways (E2p7s).  What could that mean if not that minds and bodies are identical?  Bennett argues that in Spinoza a mind and a body merely share a part (which he calls a “trans-attribute mode”).  Minds and bodies are not fully identical.  (See Bennett 1984, 141).  One “trans-attribute mode” can combine both with the attribute of thought (creating a mind) and the attribute of extension (creating a body) at the same time.  Thus, my body is a trans-attribute mode combined with the attribute of extension; my mind is that same trans-attribute mode combined with the attribute of thought.  Bennett thus rejects the interpretation of parallelism whereby a body and a mind are one and the same thing.  A body and its parallel mind merely share a part (namely, a trans-attribute mode).

By contrast Della Rocca argues that minds and bodies in Spinoza are fully identical.  Della Rocca argues that the notion of referential opacity (see the Objectivism section above) can allow Spinoza to accept both the identity of minds and bodies without accepting that minds and bodies causally interact.  Della Rocca claims that causal contexts in Spinoza are referentially opaque.  That is, x is the cause of y only under certain descriptions or ways of thinking about x.  It is not the case that the sentence “x causes y” is true under all possible ways of describing or conceiving of x.  For example, “x under a mental description caused y” can be true while “x under a physical description caused y” is false.  Thus, Della Rocca argues that the claim that minds and bodies are identical does not entail that minds and bodies causally interact because whether x caused y or not depends upon how x is described.  (See Della Rocca 1996a, 118-140, 157-167.)

5. Conatus

In Part III of the Ethics, Spinoza argues that each mode (that is, every physical and mental thing) “strives to persevere in its being” (E3p6.)  The word translated into English as “strives” is the Latin “conatus.”  (“Conatus” is also sometimes translated as “endeavor.”)  From the claim that every mode strives to persevere in its being, Spinoza infers that each mode’s conatus is the actual essence (E3p7.)  That is, what it is to be a cat is just to strive in a certain cat-like way.  What it is to be a desk is for the complex body to strive in a certain desk-like way.  Every thing that exists—every particle, rock, plant, animal, planet, solar system, idea, mind, etc.—is striving to survive.  From the claim that the essence of every mode is its striving to persist Spinoza derives much of his physics, psychology, moral philosophy, and political theory in Parts III, IV, and V of the Ethics.

Despite the importance of Spinoza’s theory of conatus, there are a number of interpretive and philosophical difficulties with it and Spinoza’s argument for it.  First, there is the widely debated issue of whether Spinoza’s theory of conatus should be interpreted teleologically or non-teleologically.  Is each mode trying to survive?  Are modes goal-oriented things?  Or is Spinoza simply claiming that everything that modes do helps them to survive (while not claiming that modes are acting purposively)?

Second, Spinoza’s argument for the theory of conatus (which takes place in Part III of the Ethics from propositions 4 to 6) has been subject to considerable scrutiny and many scholars have argued that it is multiply invalid.  A few recent scholars have, however, attempted to defend Spinoza’s argument for his conatus theory against the charge of invalidity.  Garrett 2002, for example, provides an influential defense of the validity of the argument.  Likewise, Waller (2009) provides a partial defense of the first third of the argument.

a. Conatus and Purposive Action

Spinoza clearly denies the claim that God or Nature has a purpose or plan for the universe.  The universe simply exists because it could not fail to exist.  God did not make the universe with any predetermined goal or plan in mind; instead the universe simply follows from God’s essence in just the way that the properties of a triangle follow from the essence of the triangle (E1p16, E1p32c1, E1p33).  In the Appendix to Part I of the Ethics Spinoza claims that

[People] find—both in themselves and outside themselves—many means that are very helpful in seeking their own advantage, for example, eyes for seeing, teeth for chewing, plants and animals for food, the sun for light, the sea for supporting fish.  Hence, they consider all natural things as means to their own advantage.  And knowing that they had found these means, not provided them for themselves, they had reason to believe that there was someone else who had prepared the means for their use … And since they had never heard anything about the temperament of these rules, they had to judge from themselves.  Hence, they maintained that the gods direct all things for the use of men in order to bind men to them and be held by men in the highest honor. … But while they sought to show that Nature does nothing in vain (that is, nothing not of use to men), they seem to have shown only that Nature and the gods are as mad as man.   … Not many words will be required to show that Nature has no end set before it, and that all final causes are nothing but human fictions (Ethics Part I, Appendix.)

The earth does not exist so that we may live on it.  The universe is not designed for the good of human beings.  The universe has no purpose; it simply exists.  These ideas were revolutionary in the seventeenth century and remain controversial even today.

But some scholars (most influentially, Bennett 1984) argue that Spinoza’s rejection of purpose or goals in nature goes much further than a simple rejection of Divine purposes or goals—Bennett argue that Spinoza rejects all purposive or goal directed activities whatsoever, including human purposive action.  The claim that human actions are not purposive or goal-oriented is startling and presents us with a very different theory of what human beings are.

To understand the impact of this claim, consider the following example: if I walk across the room to get a drink of water, we might believe that this activity is purposive or goal-oriented.  I am walking across the room in order to get a glass of water.  My behavior is partly explained in the common sense view by my goal or purpose (that is, getting a drink of water.)  Bennett 1984, 240-251, however, claims that according to Spinoza this explanation of my behavior must be wrong.  According to Bennett’s Spinoza, I do not walk across the room in order to get water.  Rather I walk across the room because my organs were organized in a certain way such that when light strikes my eyes, it moves certain parts of my brain, which in turn moves certain tendons in my legs, which in turn causes my legs to move back and forth in certain ways, carrying my body to the counter, moving my hand toward the water fountain, etc.  That is, my behavior can be fully and completely understood mechanistically, just like a watch.  The springs inside a watch do not move so that the watch may indicate the correct time, rather the clock indicates the correct time because the springs and levers move in a certain way.  Similarly with human beings, they do not walk in order to get to certain places; they get to certain places because they walk.  (When considering a human being under the attribute of thought, Spinoza would claim that certain ideas follow logically from other ideas in just the way that certain effects follow necessarily from certain causes in the physical world.)  In just the way that the universe exists without any purpose or goal, so every action performed by every human similarly is done for no purpose or goal.  We do what we do simply because we could not fail to—our actions simply follow from the organization of our many complex parts.

Bennett’s interpretation of Spinoza as denying all purposive or goal-oriented action is controversial because Spinoza does claim in a number of different places that while the whole of nature has no purpose or ultimate goal, individuals do act purposively.  In the Appendix to Part I, where Spinoza makes his clearest claims against Divine purposes, he also claims that “men act always on account of an end.”  This passage and other similar ones have been a problem for Bennett’s interpretation.  (See Curley 1990 and Bennett 1990 for more on this debate.)

The issue of whether purposive action is possible is important to the interpretation of Spinoza’s theory of conatus.  Does Spinoza’s theory of conatus entail that every physical thing—every animal, plant, rock, planet, solar system, idea, and mind—acts in order to persevere in its own being?  Is all of nature goal-oriented, even though the whole of nature is not?  Some (including Garrett 1999) think so.  If Garrett is right, then Spinoza’s physical theory may be a lot closer to Aristotle’s than it is to Descartes’.  Spinoza does not seem fully consistent on the point.  In the words of one recent scholar, Spinoza is “h