Category Archives: Mind & Cognitive Science

Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness

Defenders of higher-order theories of consciousness hold that consciousness is explained by the relation between two levels of mental states in which a higher-order mental state takes another mental state, such as a thought or sensation, as its object. By virtue of the higher-order state, the lower-order state is conscious. For example, I now have a visual sensation of the white and black computer screen. This sensation is conscious, according to higher-order theories, because I have a higher-order state about that sensation.Two distinctions are central to isolating the sort of consciousness the theory aims to explain. First, we can make distinctions among creature consciousness, state consciousness, and introspective consciousness. Creature consciousness is a property possessed by creatures that are awake and sentient. Since wakefulness and sentience are fairly straightforward biological features, there seems to be no special problem to be solved regarding creature consciousness. State consciousness is a property of mental states that marks the difference between unconscious and conscious states. When a state is conscious, there is something it is like to be in that state. Introspective consciousness involves attending to one’s own mental states. According to higher-order theory, the mystery of consciousness lies in the nature of conscious states, and the mystery can be explained in terms of higher-order representation. My mental state is conscious – that is, there is something it is like to be in my mental state – when I have a higher-order representation about it.

An intuitive way to talk about consciousness is to say that a mental state is conscious when we are conscious of it. But this intuitive formulation utilizes two different uses of the word "conscious." The first use is called intransitive, because this form of consciousness has no object. State consciousness is an intransitive form of consciousness. The second use is called transitive, because this form of consciousness takes an object; transitive consciousness is consciousness of something. Introspective consciousness is a transitive form of consciousness, because it takes mental states as objects. With this distinction in hand we can restate the higher-order explanation in this way: intransitive state consciousness is explained in terms of transitive consciousness of mental states.

Table of Contents

  1. Two Problem of Consciousness
  2. The Higher-order Solution
  3. Higher-order Thought Theory
    1. Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV)
    2. Dispositional Higher-order Thought Theory
  4. Higher-order Perception Theory
  5. On Terminology and Target
  6. Simple or Simplistic: An Assessment
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Two Problem of Consciousness

Conscious states are a central feature of our waking life. When we gaze at a spectacular array of fall leaves as they change color, smell onions frying or touch the soft skin of a newborn, we appreciate the feelings unique to each experience. There is something it is like to have these feelings, but what exactly? Though conscious states are ubiquitous in our everyday lives, we rarely reflect on their nature, and when we do, we find them frustratingly difficult to describe. We point to the contents of consciousness, what we are conscious of, and the qualities associated with those contents: the reds and yellows of leaves, the pungent odor of onions, the smoothness of skin. The distinctive character of each of these qualities marks one problem of consciousness: how to account for the differences between red and yellow, pungent and sweet, smooth and rough. A second problem, central to higher-order theory, is to explain what is in common to all conscious states, what it is like to have any kind of feelings at all. In other words, higher-order theories of consciousness propose to explain the nature of conscious states, as such.

2. The Higher-order Solution

In order to account for the nature of conscious states, the question a higher-order theorist must answer is: why is there something it is like to be in conscious states when there is nothing it is like to be in unconscious states, such as a coma state or a state of dreamless sleep? What is the difference between these two types of states? In particular, what makes a mental state a conscious mental state? As noted above, a higher-order account of consciousness proposes that a mental state is conscious when there is a higher-order state, either a thought or a perception, about it. Say I wake up feeling a terrible pain in my knee, but as I become involved in the day’s activities, I so completely forget about the pain that it ceases to hurt. With each lull in my busy schedule, though, the feeling of pain returns in full force. In light of the similarity in feeling and biological foundation, it is reasonable to say that the same sensation of pain remains throughout the day, although I am only occasionally conscious of the pain. The higher-order theory captures the intuitive plausibility of this explanation by describing consciousness of the pain in terms of a higher-order thought or perception about the otherwise unconscious pain state. When I forget about the pain, there is no higher-order state and so I remain unconscious of the pain. Later in the day, a higher-order state about the pain recurs, and in virtue of this higher-order state I am again conscious of the pain.

The higher-order state is about the lower-order state, which is to say that an intentional relation holds between the higher-order and lower-order states. Thoughts and perceptions are two familiar sorts of intentional states. Thoughts can be about things in the world, such as a tree or an onion. Thoughts can be about abstract items, such as numbers or average families. And thoughts can be about other thoughts, as when I think: I am thinking about consciousness too much; I should take a break.

Perceptions can also be about things in the world, such as when I see a tree or smell an onion. Notably, perceptions are much more detailed than thoughts, capturing a wide array of sensory variation. On the other hand, it is less clear how perceptions could be about abstract items or thoughts. One way to perceive abstract things could be by virtue of concrete representations, so you might be said to see the number 3 by means of the numeral that represents it. Similarly, a thought might be expressed in subvocal speech, as when I think to myself a sentence like: “I am thinking about consciousness too much; I should take a break.”

The differences between thoughts and perceptions yield reasons in favor of each form of higher-order account. They will be considered in turn, beginning with the higher-order thought theory. Several versions of higher-order thought theory have been proposed since David Rosenthal (1986) introduced the theory. Two versions to be considered below are the Wide-Intrinsicality View (WIV), developed by Rocco Gennaro (1996) and the dispositional higher-order thought theory, proposed by Peter Carruthers (2000).

3. Higher-order Thought Theory

Recall that the basic role of higher-order theories is to account for the nature of conscious states in terms of higher-order states about them. According to Rosenthal’s higher-order thought theory (1986, 1997, 2005), a mental state is conscious when there is a higher-order thought about it. I am conscious of the pain in my knee when I have a thought to the effect that I am in that very pain state.

A few refinements and elaborations of this basic formulation are necessary to avert various straightforward difficulties. First, Rosenthal notes that state consciousness must seem immediate. When I am conscious of my pain, I am not conscious of any inferential process preceding the consciousness. I do not think to myself, "Wow, I just hit my knee really hard, I must be feeling pain." Similarly, if a doctor informed me that my knee surgery would likely involve lingering pain, this information alone would be insufficient to make my pain conscious. No conscious inferential or observational process intervenes between a mental state and the higher-order thought about it.

Second, consciousness is a relational property of mental states; it is not intrinsic to their nature. For example, if someone began calling you by a nickname, no intrinsic feature of you would change, but you would now be represented in a new way. Similarly, a mental state is conscious by virtue of standing in a representational relation to a higher-order thought. The mental state itself does not change when it is conscious; rather, it acquires a new relation. Some have found this feature of the higher-order account implausible, arguing that consciousness seems to mark a change in the intrinsic nature of conscious states. (Gennaro 1996) A commitment to consciousness as intrinsic prompted the introduction of a version of higher-order thought theory called the Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV) , which is discussed in the next section.

A third important feature of higher-order thoughts on Rosenthal’s account is that they are assertoric and occurrent. The higher-order thought must assert, rather than hope, fear or speculate that I am in a particular mental state. Moreover, the higher-order thought must occur at roughly the same time as the mental state it represents. The content of the higher-order thought should be, for example: "I am now feeling pain," not "I might have felt pain yesterday" or "Perhaps I will feel pain in a few minutes." Rosenthal (1997) has argued that higher-order thoughts must be occurrent in order to distinguish between non-conscious and conscious states. If the mere disposition to produce a higher-order thought were sufficient for a mental state to be conscious, it seems that all one’s mental states would always be conscious. But the example of intermittent knee pain suggests that we may be conscious of mental states at one time, and not conscious of them at another time. The recent development of a dispositional version of higher-order thought theory addresses this concern and will be considered below.

Fourth, higher-order thoughts are not introspective states. Since conscious states are a regular feature of our waking life, it may seem that higher-order thoughts should be equally apparent on this account. However, as Rosenthal (1986) points out, a higher-order thought is only conscious when there is a yet higher-order thought about it, and these conscious higher-order thoughts constitute introspective states. Since introspection is a fairly rare occurrence, it should not be surprising that we are rarely aware of our higher-order thoughts. It is interesting to note that higher-order thought theory differs from higher-order perception theory in this description of the relation between state consciousness and introspection. According to higher-order perception theory, all higher-order states are introspective states, although the active, deliberate form of introspection is fairly rare. (Armstrong 1968, 1999; Lycan 1996) Both theories agree that lower-order states are conscious by virtue of appropriate higher-order states, but they differ in their description of how the presence of higher-order states solves the problem of consciousness. While this difference could simply be a terminological issue, substantive consequences may follow (see On Terminology and Target ).

A final feature of the theory is the importance of self-reference within the content of the higher-order thought. Conscious states are mental states of one’s own. I can only be conscious of my knee pain, not yours. Rosenthal (1997) stresses that a minimal self-concept is sufficient to secure the reference necessary for higher-order thoughts; only the ability to distinguish between one’s self and something other than one’s self is required. Consequently, creatures with limited conceptual capacities may have conscious states. Where we would describe the content of a higher-order thoughts as, for example, ‘I am feeling pain,’ a more neutral formulation might be ‘this individual is feeling pain.’ Though Rosenthal minimizes the requirements for self-reference in higher-order thought content, the self, which is the subject of consciousness, figures centrally in the theory. Only a person or creature can be transitively conscious of things; mental states alone cannot bear the appropriate relation to other mental states. It may be in virtue of a mental state, namely, a higher-order thought, that one is conscious, but the higher-order thought itself cannot be transitively conscious of anything. (Rosenthal 1997) When I am conscious of my knee pain, I am conscious of the pain by virtue of a higher-order thought about the pain.

This qualification generates some confusion as to how exactly higher-order thoughts explain conscious states. (Droege 2003) First we find that consciousness is not an intrinsic feature of a mental state, it is a relational feature constituted by the presence of a higher-order thought about it. The higher-order thought explains the state consciousness. But not quite, for a higher-order thought – even of the right kind – is insufficient for state consciousness. There must be a creature who is transitively conscious of her mental states, in virtue of having a higher-order thought about them. The important role of the creature as the subject of consciousness suggests that creature consciousness bears more weight in the higher-order thought account than the definitions above admit.

Two other objections apply generally to higher-order thought accounts of consciousness. First, note that the content of the higher-order thought determines the content of consciousness. When functioning properly, the content of an occurrent mental state forms the content of the higher-order thought. It is possible, however, for higher-order thought content to be empty or to misrepresent a mental state. In such cases I might be conscious of a pain in my knee, while in fact the sensation is located in my hip, or is a phantom pain. (Neander 1998, Levine 2001) In response, Rosenthal has argued that these forms of reference failure are rare and detectable, and so do not constitute a problem for higher-order theory. (Rosenthal, 1986, 1991)

A second objection involves the possibility of animal and infant consciousness. Because thoughts require concepts, there is some question about whether simple creatures like bats are conceptually sophisticated enough to be considered conscious on this account. Carruthers (1989, 1999) has accepted the consequence that animals are not conscious on the higher-order account and has argued that our sympathy for animal suffering is motivated by the animal’s pain sensation and its behavioral effects rather than by the animal’s consciousness of pain. On the other hand, Rosenthal (1997) and Gennaro (1993, 2004b) claim that animal consciousness is not ruled out by the theory because higher-order thoughts need not be more sophisticated than conceptually rudimentary content such as “this feeling.”

a. Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV)

As noted above, versions of higher-order thought theory differ on some key points. According to the version developed by Rocco Gennaro (1996), conscious states are complex states composed of a mental state and a higher-order thought about it. This theory is known as the Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV) because consciousness is intrinsic to these complex states. The primary motivation for this version of higher-order thought theory is the sense that consciousness inheres in conscious states themselves. The remarkable change that occurs when a mental state becomes conscious seems to involve a change in that very mental state rather than a change in relations external to it. From this perspective, the relation ‘represented by a higher-order thought’ seems no more able to account for the phenomenon of consciousness than the relation ‘to the left of.' In response to this problem, the WIV takes the higher-order relation to be internal rather than external to the conscious state. Therefore, consciousness is intrinsic to the state constituted by a mental state and the higher-order thought about it.

Furthermore, a higher-order relation changes the nature of a mental state. Following Kant, Gennaro argues that concepts must be applied to sensory states in order to organize sensory information into a coherent array of objects. Higher-order thoughts provide the conceptual resources that determine the content of the conscious sensation. A self-referential component is also necessary to relate one’s experience of the world to one’s self. Yet it is important to note that the higher-order component of the conscious state is implicit. All I feel is the hurtfulness, but in order for the pain to feel the specific content of ‘hurtful,’ a higher-order concept needs to be applied to the sensation, and in order for the pain to feel hurtful to me, a self-referential component is needed as well. The higher-order thought fulfills these functions, thereby making the pain sensation conscious.

Rosenthal has objected that intrinsic theories, such as the WIV, fail to provide a reductive explanation of consciousness. If consciousness is an intrinsic property of conscious states, then they are simple and unanalyzable and so inexplicable. (Rosenthal 1986, 1991) In response, Gennaro (1996) denies that the intrinsic nature of consciousness is incompatible with its complexity. A conscious state can be explained in terms of the mental state and the higher-order thought that compose it, even though the property of consciousness is intrinsic to the whole complex state. However, as Rosenthal (1997) observes, the complexity of the conscious state makes it equally plausible to regard the property as extrinsic to the lower-order state and explainable by the presence of a distinct higher-order thought.

b. Dispositional Higher-order Thought Theory

A third version of the theory suggests that higher-order thoughts function dispositionally: mental states are conscious when they are available to a system capable of producing higher-order thoughts, even if no actual higher-order thought occurs. In answer to Rosenthal’s worry that all mental states would be conscious on a dispositional theory, Peter Carruthers (2000) has argued that two perceptual systems exist. One system is primarily action guiding and utilizes unconscious perceptual states. An unconscious pain in my knee, for example, might lead me to favor one leg when walking, even if I did not realize that I was limping. The other perceptual system is designed to generate beliefs about perceptual information, so perceptual states in this system must carry information about the pain and about my experience of the pain.

On the functional/inferential role account of content advocated by Carruthers, the content of a mental state is partly determined by the information it carries. Since the function of the belief-forming perceptual system is to produce higher-order thoughts, the states in this system take on two kinds of content: the perceptual content ‘is painful’ and the higher-order content ‘seems painful.’ The pain acquires the subjective, experiential aspect of ‘seeming painful’ by virtue of my ability to think about the pain and to form beliefs about it. The pain may cause me to limp, and it also may cause me to think about how much my knee hurts and to plan what I might do to relieve the pain. In order to be able to think about my pain, it must seem some way to me; it must seem painful. Carruthers argues that perceptual states are conscious when they acquire the higher-order content that constitutes the experiential aspect of the perceptual state.

This version of higher-order thought theory is particularly interesting because it is also a form of higher-order perception theory. According to Carruthers, both forms of content involved in conscious states are fine-grained, non-conceptual content, in other words, perceptual content. I can perceive a red object without knowing that it is red and without being able to identify its particular shade of red. Likewise, an object may seem red to me without further categorization or description, provided I have the ability to make these sorts of judgments. On the dispositional higher-order thought account, perceptual states acquire higher-order content by virtue of their availability to a system capable of forming higher-order thoughts, and they possess this dual content whether or not a higher-order thought is formed. Consequently, no actual higher-order thought or higher-order perception (and so no inner sense mechanism) is required for consciousness.

4. Higher-order Perception Theory

Though there have been more advocates of the higher-order thought theory in recent years, the higher-order perception theory is arguably the first higher-order account of consciousness. Its roots trace to John Locke’s inner sense theory where he distinguishes two ways of acquiring knowledge: perception and reflection. Perception yields ideas of sensible qualities such as yellow, hot, and soft.

“The other Fountain [reflection], from which Experience furnisheth the Understanding with Ideas, is the Perception of the Operations of our own Minds within us, as it is employ’d about the Ideas it has got.” (Essay II, 1, §4, 104) Locke describes the way we perceive the operations of our minds as comparable to an ‘internal sense.’ A few sections later in the Essay, Locke then identifies consciousness with the process of reflection when he states: “Consciousness is the perception of what passes in a Man’s own mind.” (Essay II, 1, §19, 115)

Contemporary theorists David Armstrong (1968, 1981, 1999) and William Lycan (1987, 1996) follow Locke in arguing that consciousness should be explained in terms of the operation of an inner sense. Our mental states are conscious when internal scanners produce perceptual representations of them. The process of internal scanning, or higher-order monitoring, is to coordinate and relay information about mental states in order to better plan and monitor action. Inner scanners fulfill this function by producing higher-order perceptual representations.

Like higher-order thought theory, state consciousness is explained in terms of higher-order representations of mental states. On both forms of theory my knee pain is conscious when I acquire a higher-order representation about the pain. Unlike higher-order thought theory, the higher-order representation is similar to perceptual representation on the inner sense account. Conceptual discrimination is more limited than perceptual discrimination, so one point in favor of the higher-order perception account is its ability to accommodate the rich detail of conscious states. (Lycan 2004) Moreover, no special conceptual powers are required to produce higher-order perceptions, so there is no reason animals could not be conscious on this view.

One concern about the higher-order perception theory involves the nature of the ‘inner sense.’ Although an ‘inner sense’ or ‘internal scanners’ are central to the higher-order perception theory, the theory does not depend on the existence of a dedicated organ. Armstrong (1968) has compared inner sensing to proprioception in its wide distribution and function. Lycan (1996, 2004) has suggested that inner sensing is accomplished by means of attention mechanisms.

A more persistent problem with the higher-order perception theory is the claim that it is impossible to attend to one’s mental states. Most famously argued by G.E. Moore (1903), the transparency claim is that any attempt to attend to a sensation immediately results in attention to the object that the sensation represents. A related objection notes that unlike perceptual states, no special qualities are associated with conscious states. If there was an inner sense, we would expect inner sensory qualities on a par with visual, auditory and tactile qualities. (Rosenthal 1997) Finally, it is worth noting that, like higher-order thoughts, higher-order perceptions might be empty or misrepresent the states they are about. In such a case, you might feel a sensation of pain that in fact was a sensation of cold, or you might feel a pain in the absence of any sensation at all. (Neander 1998) As with Rosenthal, Lycan (1998) takes this to be a case of a higher-order representation as of pain in the absence of a pain sensation, and argues that the result would be a strange, pain-like feeling in the absence of the behavioral effects of pain.

5. On Terminology and Target

One difficulty in comparing higher-order thought and higher-order perception theories involves determining the target for explanation. While both forms of theory are similarly structured, it is unclear that they take the same phenomenon for their explanandum. Notwithstanding disputes among the higher-order thought theorists listed above, the central claim of higher-order thought theory is clear – higher-order thoughts account for the difference between conscious states and unconscious states; state consciousness constitutes the great mystery of consciousness. The higher-order perception theory also explains the difference between conscious states and unconscious states, but Lycan (1996) argues that this difference is not the truly mysterious aspect of consciousness. Rather, the primary value in higher-order perception theory lies in its explanation of what it’s like for the subject to be in conscious states as opposed to unconscious states. Lycan identifies this explanadum as subjective consciousness. The difference may simply be a matter of emphasis, but it raises a general question about the explanandum of higher-order theory: whether the theory explains a difference in the nature of the mental states, as higher-order thought theory claims, or a difference in the nature of the subject of the mental states, as higher-order perception theory suggests.

6. Simple or Simplistic: An Assessment

The central virtue of higher-order theories of consciousness lies in their explanatory simplicity. Each of these theories accounts for the phenomena of consciousness exclusively in terms of familiar types of mental states: thoughts and perceptions. Higher-order mental states are also well-known from deliberate, self-conscious introspection. So, it seems reasonable to think that consciousness might be explained by a kind of higher-order process that is more automatic and lacks the attentive self-consciousness that accompanies more focused forms of reflection. Thus, higher-order theories avoid invoking mysterious processes or unknown structures to account for consciousness; there are no ‘ontological danglers.’ More complex states are explained in terms of less complex states and various relations, such as ‘aboutness.' As a result, consciousness is seen to be of a piece with other mental phenomena, which are in turn accountable in natural, physical terms. Consciousness is special, and in its own way mysterious, but it is amenable to explanation.

As often happens, the primary disadvantage of higher-order theories follows from their primary advantage. The explanation seems too simple to account for the elusive difference between conscious and unconscious states, and so higher-order theory strikes many as implausible. The most often cited problem – known variously as the problem of absent qualia, the hard problem of consciousness (Chalmers 1996), and the explanatory gap (Levine 1983, 2001) – is that it seems higher-order states can perform their functions in the absence of any conscious feeling. Unless one is already an adherent of the higher-order view, there seems no reason to believe that the acquisition of higher-order states, however carefully described, should usher in the sights, sounds and feels of our conscious life. Rosenthal (1991) and Lycan (1998) argue that qualitative differences, such as the difference between red and green, can be accounted for by differences in first-order sensory states. When we acquire higher-order states we become aware of these differences among our sensory states. Nonetheless, one can ask how exactly those differences become conscious by the acquisition of a higher-order state. One answer is that higher-order representation is simply what consciousness is. The intuition Rosenthal often utilizes as a grounding premise in arguing for higher-order theory is that a conscious state is a mental state one is conscious of. (Rosenthal 1986, 1993b, 1997, 2002, 2004) Given this initial premise, higher-order theory follows quickly. (Lycan 2001)

Further support for higher-order thought explanation of consciousness can be found in the connection between the acquisition of concepts and finer sensory discrimination. Wine tasters, for example, are able to appreciate subtle differences in the smell and taste of wine as a result of their understanding of its various properties. Additionally, the feeling of pain experienced by dental patients can be eased when they realize their anxiety leads them to misinterpret the vibration of the drill. (Rosenthal 2002) In defense of the higher-order perception theory, Lycan (1996) claims that an explanatory gap is unsurprising. On his account, the way each of us represents our own mental states is unique, determined by the functional role that higher-order representations play within the overall representational system that constitutes our minds. We can only talk about, and so explain, features of our first-order sensory representations – such as the difference between a sensation of red and a sensation of green – because we share the referents, red and green colored objects, in common. When we move to higher-order representation, we leave the realm of language and are left with only private means of referring to our sensations as, well, like that.

By incorporating first-order and higher-order content into the same conscious state, Carruthers (2000) and Gennaro (1996) draw a closer connection between the higher-order account of state consciousness and the account of qualitative difference. As we saw above, Carruthers maintains that conscious states have both first-order content, such as red, and higher-order content, seems red. So for Carruthers, differences in higher-order content constitute the differences in our conscious experiences of red and green. Similarly, Gennaro (2004b) argues that the qualitative properties of mental states inhere in the complex conscious state rather than in first-order states. Without the presence of a higher-order thought, the first-order perception lacks the distinctive character involved in seeing red.

In any case, it is important to recognize that higher-order theory is put forward as an empirical hypothesis, rather than an analysis of the logical relations for the term ‘consciousness.' The project is to explain the phenomena of consciousness in relation to other mental states, such as thought and perception, and so to develop a stronger theoretical framework for understanding the mind. We may be able to imagine consciousness in the absence of higher-order states, but this does not mean that we can explain consciousness in the absence of higher-order states. Or so higher-order theorists maintain. (Rosenthal 2002, Carruthers 2000)

7. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, David M. 1968. A Materialist Theory of the Mind. New York: Humanities.
  • Armstrong, David M. 1981. The Nature of Mind and Other Essays. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Armstrong, David M. 1999. The Mind-Body Problem. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Armstrong, David M., and Norman Malcolm. 1984. Consciousness and Causality. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Byrne, Alex. 1997. “Some Like it HOT: Consciousness and Higher-Order Thoughts,” Philosophical Studies 86: 103-29.
  • Carruthers, Peter. 1989. “Brute Experience,” Journal of Philosophy 86, no. 5: 258-69.
  • Carruthers, Peter. 1996. Language, Thought and Consciousness: An Essay in Philosophical Psychology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Carruthers, Peter. 1999. “Sympathy and subjectivity,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 77: 465-82.
  • Carruthers, Peter. 2000. Phenomenal Consciousness: A Naturalistic Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chalmers, David J. 1996. The Conscious Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dretske, Fred I. 1993. “Conscious Experience,” Mind 102, no. 406: 265-81.
  • Droege, Paula. 2003. Caging the Beast: A Theory of Sensory Consciousness. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing.
  • Gennaro, Rocco. 1996. Consciousness and Self-Consciousness: A Defense of the Higher-Order Thought Theory of Consciousness. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing.
  • Gennaro, Rocco. Editor. 2004a. Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Gennaro, Rocco. 2004b. “Higher-Order Thoughts, Animal Consciousness, and Misrepresentation,” In Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness. Editor Rocco Gennaro, 45-66. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Güzeldere, Güven. 1995. “Is Consciousness the Perception of What Passes in One's Own Mind?” in Conscious Experience. Editor Thomas Metzinger, 335-58. Paderborn: Ferdinand Schoeningh.
  • Levine, Joseph. 1983. “Materialism and Qualia: The Explanatory Gap,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 64: 354-61.
  • Levine, Joseph. 2001. Purple Haze: The Puzzle of Consciousness. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Locke, John. 1689/1975. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Editor Peter Nidditch. Oxford: Clarenden Press.
  • Lycan, William. 1987. Consciousness. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Lycan, William. 1996. Consciousness and Experience. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Lycan, William. 1998. “In Defense of the Representational Theory of Qualia,” in Language, Mind, and Ontology. Editor James E. Tomberlin, 479-87. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Lycan, William. 2001. “A Simple Argument for a Higher-Order Representation Theory of Consciousness,” Analysis 61, no. 1: 3-4.
  • Lycan, William. 2004. “The Superiority of HOP to HOT,” in Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness. Editor Rocco Gennaro, 93-114. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Moore, G. E. 1903. “The Refutation of Idealism,” Mind 12: 433-453.
  • Neander, Karen. 1998. “The Division of Phenomenal Labor: A Problem for Representational Theories of Consciousness,” In Language, Mind, and Ontology. Editor James E. Tomberlin, 411-34. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Rey, Georges. 1998. “A Narrow Representationalist Account of Qualitative Experience,” in Language, Mind, and Ontology. Editor James E. Tomberlin, 435-57. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1986. “Two Concepts of Consciousness,” Philosophical Studies 49, no. 3: 329-59.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1991. “The Independence of Consciousness and Sensory Quality,” in Consciousness. Editor Enrique Villanueva, 15-36. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1993a. “State Consciousness and Transitive Consciousness,” in Consciousness and Cognition 2: 355-63.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1993b. “Thinking that One Thinks,” in Consciousness: Psychological and Philosophical Essays . Editor Martin Davies and Glyn W. Humphreys, 197-223. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1997. “A Theory of Consciousness,” in The Nature of Consciousness: Philosophical Debates. Editors Ned Block, Owen Flanagan, and Güven Güzuldere, 729-54. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1999. “The Colors and Shapes of Visual Experiences,” in Consciousness and Intentionality: Models and Modalities of Attribution. Editor Denis Fisette, 95-118. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 2002. “Explaining Consciousness,” in Philosophy of Mind: Classical and Contemporary Readings. Editor David Chalmers, 406-421. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 2004. “Varieties of Higher-Order Theory,” in Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness. Editor Rocco Gennaro, 17-44. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 2005 . Consciousness and Mind. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Author Information

Paula Droege
Pennsylvania State University
U. S. A.


In philosophy, egoism is the theory that one’s self is, or should be, the motivation and the goal of one’s own action. Egoism has two variants, descriptive or normative. The descriptive (or positive) variant conceives egoism as a factual description of human affairs. That is, people are motivated by their own interests and desires, and they cannot be described otherwise. The normative variant proposes that people should be so motivated, regardless of what presently motivates their behavior. Altruism is the opposite of egoism. The term “egoism” derives from “ego,” the Latin term for “I” in English. Egoism should be distinguished from egotism, which means a psychological overvaluation of one’s own importance, or of one’s own activities.

People act for many reasons; but for whom, or what, do or should they act—for themselves, for God, or for the good of the planet? Can an individual ever act only according to her own interests without regard for others’ interests. Conversely, can an individual ever truly act for others in complete disregard for her own interests? The answers will depend on an account of free will. Some philosophers argue that an individual has no choice in these matters, claiming that a person’s acts are determined by prior events which make illusory any belief in choice. Nevertheless, if an element of choice is permitted against the great causal impetus from nature, or God, it follows that a person possesses some control over her next action, and, that, therefore, one may inquire as to whether the individual does, or, should choose a self-or-other-oriented action. Morally speaking, one can ask whether the individual should pursue her own interests, or, whether she should reject self-interest and pursue others’ interest instead: to what extent are other-regarding acts morally praiseworthy compared to self-regarding acts?

Table of Contents

  1. Descriptive and Psychological Egoism
  2. Normative Egoism
    1. Rational Egoism
    2. Ethical Egoism
      1. Conditional Egoism
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Descriptive and Psychological Egoism

The descriptive egoist’s theory is called “psychological egoism.” Psychological egoism describes human nature as being wholly self-centered and self-motivated. Examples of this explanation of human nature predate the formation of the theory, and, are found in writings such as that of British Victorian historian, Macaulay, and, in that of British Reformation political philosopher, Thomas Hobbes. To the question, “What proposition is there respecting human nature which is absolutely and universally true?", Macaulay, replies, "We know of only one . . . that men always act from self-interest." (Quoted in Garvin.) In Leviathan, Hobbes maintains that, "No man giveth but with intention of good to himself; because gift is voluntary; and of all voluntary acts the object to every man is his own pleasure." In its strong form, psychological egoism asserts that people always act in their own interests, and, cannot but act in their own interests, even though they may disguise their motivation with references to helping others or doing their duty.

Opponents claim that psychological egoism renders ethics useless. However, this accusation assumes that ethical behavior is necessarily other-regarding, which opponents would first have to establish. Opponents may also exploit counterfactual evidence to criticize psychological egoism— surely, they claim, there is a host of evidence supporting altruistic or duty bound actions that cannot be said to engage the self-interest of the agent. However, what qualifies to be counted as apparent counterfactual evidence by opponents becomes an intricate and debatable issue. This is because, in response to their opponents, psychological egoists may attempt to shift the question away from outward appearances to ultimate motives of acting benevolently towards others; for example, they may claim that seemingly altruistic behavior (giving a stranger some money) necessarily does have a self-interested component. For example, if the individual were not to offer aid to a stranger, he or she may feel guilty or may look bad in front of a peer group.

On this point, psychological egoism’s validity turns on examining and analyzing moral motivation. But since motivation is inherently private and inaccessible to others (an agent could be lying to herself or to others about the original motive), the theory shifts from a theoretical description of human nature--one that can be put to observational testing--to an assumption about the inner workings of human nature: psychological egoism moves beyond the possibility of empirical verification and the possibility of empirical negation (since motives are private), and therefore it becomes what is termed a “closed theory.”

A closed theory is a theory that rejects competing theories on its own terms and is non-verifiable and non-falsifiable. If psychological egoism is reduced to an assumption concerning human nature and its hidden motives, then it follows that it is just as valid to hold a competing theory of human motivation such as psychological altruism.

Psychological altruism holds that all human action is necessarily other-centered, and other-motivated. One’s becoming a hermit (an apparently selfish act) can be reinterpreted through psychological altruism as an act of pure noble selflessness: a hermit is not selfishly hiding herself away, rather, what she is doing is not inflicting her potentially ungraceful actions or displeasing looks upon others. A parallel analysis of psychological altruism thus results in opposing conclusions to psychological egoism. However, psychological altruism is arguably just as closed as psychological egoism: with it one assumes that an agent’s inherently private and consequently unverifiable motives are altruistic. If both theories can be validly maintained, and if the choice between them becomes the flip of a coin, then their soundness must be questioned.

A weak version of psychological egoism accepts the possibility of altruistic or benevolent behavior, but maintains that, whenever a choice is made by an agent to act, the action is by definition one that the agent wants to do at that point. The action is self-serving, and is therefore sufficiently explained by the theory of psychological egoism. Let one assume that person A wants to help the poor; therefore, A is acting egoistically by actually wanting to help; again, if A ran into a burning building to save a kitten, it must be the case that A wanted or desired to save the kitten. However, defining all motivations as what an agent desires to do remains problematic: logically, the theory becomes tautologous and therefore unable to provide a useful, descriptive meaning of motivation because one is essentially making an arguably philosophically uninteresting claim that an agent is motivated to do what she is motivated to do. Besides which, if helping others is what A desires to do, then to what extent can A be continued to be called an egoist? A acts because that is what A does, and consideration of the ethical “ought” becomes immediately redundant. Consequently, opponents argue that psychological egoism is philosophically inadequate because it sidesteps the great nuances of motive. For example, one can argue that the psychological egoist’s notion of motive sidesteps the clashes that her theory has with the notion of duty, and, related social virtues such as honor, respect, and reputation, which fill the tomes of history and literature.

David Hume, in his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (Appendix II—Of Self Love), offers six rebuttals of what he calls the “selfish hypothesis,” an arguably archaic relative of psychological egoism. First, Hume argues that self-interest opposes moral sentiments that may engage one in concern for others, and, may motivate one’s actions for others. These moral sentiments include love, friendship, compassion, and gratitude. Second, psychological egoism attempts to reduce human motivation to a single cause, which is a ‘fruitless’ task—the "love of simplicity…has been the source of much false reasoning in philosophy." Third, it is evident that animals act benevolently towards one another, and, if it is admitted that animals can act altruistically, then how can it be denied in humans? Fourth, the concepts we use to describe benevolent behavior cannot be meaningless; sometimes an agent obviously does not have a personal interest in the fortune of another, yet will wish her well. Any attempt to create an imaginary vested interest, as the psychological egoist will attempt, proves futile. Fifth, Hume asserts that we have prior motivations to self-interest; we may have, for example, a predisposition towards vanity, fame, or vengeance that transcends any benefit to the agent. Finally, Hume claims that even if the selfish hypothesis were true, there are a sufficient number of dispositions to generate a wide possibility of moral actions, allowing one person to be called vicious and another humane; and he claims that the latter is to be preferred over the former.

2. Normative Egoism

The second variant of egoism is normative in that it stipulates the agent ought to promote the self above other values. Herbert Spencer said, “Ethics has to recognize the truth, recognized in unethical thought, that egoism comes before altruism. The acts required for continued self-preservation, including the enjoyments of benefits achieved by such arts, are the first requisites to universal welfare. Unless each duly cares for himself, his care for all others is ended in death, and if each thus dies there remain no others to be cared for.” He was echoing a long history of the importance of self-regarding behavior that can be traced back to Aristotle’s theory of friendship in the Nichomachaean Ethics. In his theory, Aristotle argues that a man must befriend himself before he can befriend others. The general theory of normative egoism does not attempt to describe human nature directly, but asserts how people ought to behave. It comes in two general forms: rational egoism and ethical egoism.

a. Rational Egoism

Rational egoism claims that the promotion of one’s own interests is always in accordance with reason. The greatest and most provocative proponent of rational egoism is Ayn Rand, whose The Virtue of Selfishness outlines the logic and appeal of the theory. Rand argues that: first, properly defined, selfishness rejects the sacrificial ethics of the West’s Judaic-Christian heritage on the grounds that it is right for man to live his own life; and, Rand argues that, second, selfishness is a proper virtue to pursue. That being said, she rejects the “selfless selfishness” of irrationally acting individuals: “the actor must always be the beneficiary of his action and that man must act for his own rational self-interest.” To be ethically selfish thus entails a commitment to reason rather than to emotionally driven whims and instincts.

In the strong version of rational egoism defended by Rand, not only is it rational to pursue one’s own interests, it is irrational not to pursue them. In a weaker version, one may note that while it is rational to pursue one’s own interests, there may be occasions when not pursuing them is not necessarily irrational.

Critics of rational egoism may claim that reason may dictate that one’s interests should not govern one’s actions. The possibility of conflicting reasons in a society need not be evoked in this matter; one need only claim that reason may invoke an impartiality clause, in other words, a clause that demands that in a certain situation one’s interests should not be furthered. For example, consider a free-rider situation. In marking students’ papers, a teacher may argue that to offer inflated grades is to make her life easier, and, therefore, is in her self-interest: marking otherwise would incur negative feedback from students and having to spend time counseling on writing skills, and so on. It is even arguably foreseeable that inflating grades may never have negative consequences for anyone. The teacher could conceivably free-ride on the tougher marking of the rest of the department or university and not worry about the negative consequences of a diminished reputation to either. However, impartiality considerations demand an alternative course—it is not right to change grades to make life easier. Here self-interest conflicts with reason. Nonetheless, a Randian would reject the teacher’s free-riding being rational: since the teacher is employed to mark objectively and impartially in the first place, to do otherwise is to commit a fraud both against the employing institution and the student. (This is indeed an analogous situation explored in Rand’s The Fountainhead, in which the hero architect regrets having propped up a friend’s inabilities).

A simpler scenario may also be considered. Suppose that two men seek the hand of one woman, and they deduce that they should fight for her love. A critic may reason that the two men rationally claim that if one of them were vanquished, the other may enjoy the beloved. However, the solution ignores the woman’s right to choose between her suitors, and thus the men’s reasoning is flawed.

In a different scenario, game theory (emanating from John von Neumann’s and Oskar Morgenstern’s Theory of Games and Economic Behaviour, 1944) points to another possible logical error in rational egoism by offering an example in which the pursuit of self-interest results in both agents being made worse off.

This is famously described in the Prisoner’s Dilemma.

Prisoner B
Confess Don't confess

Prisoner A

Confess 5,5 ½,10
Don't Confess 10,½ 2,2

From the table, two criminals, A and B, face different sentences depending on whether they confess their guilt or not. Each prisoner does not know what his partner will choose and communication between the two prisoners is not permitted. There are no lawyers and presumably no humane interaction between the prisoners and their captors.

Rationally (i.e., from the point of view of the numbers involved), we can assume that both will want to minimize their sentences. Herein lies the rub - if both avoid confessing, they will serve 2 years each – a total of 4 years between them. If they both happen to confess, they each serve 5 years each, or 10 years between them.

However they both face a tantalizing option: if A confesses while his partner doesn’t confess, A can get away in 6 months leaving B to languish for 10 years (and the same is true for B): this would result in a collective total of 10.5 years served.

For the game, the optimal solution is assumed to be the lowest total years served, which would be both refusing to confess and each therefore serving 2 years each.
The probable outcome of the dilemma though is that both will confess in the desire to get off in 6 months, but therefore they will end up serving 10 years in total.
This is seen to be non-rational or sub-optimal for both prisoners as the total years served is not the best collective solution.

The Prisoner’s Dilemma offers a mathematical model as to why self-interested action could lead to a socially non-optimal equilibrium (in which the participants all end up in a worse scenario). To game theorists, many situations can be modeled in a similar way to the classic Prisoner’s Dilemma including issues of nuclear deterrence, environmental pollution, corporate advertising campaigns and even romantic dates.

Supporters identify a game “as any interaction between agents that is governed by a set of rules specifying the possible moves for each participant and a set of outcomes for each possible combination of moves.” They add: “One is hard put to find an example of social phenomenon that cannot be so described.” (Hargreaves-Heap and Varoufakis, p.1).

Nonetheless, it can be countered that the nature of the game artificially pre-empts other possibilities: the sentences are fixed not by the participants but by external force (the game masters), so the choices facing the agents are outside of their control. Although this may certainly be applied to the restricted choices facing the two prisoners or contestants in a game, it is not obvious that every-day life generates such limited and limiting choices. The prisoner’s dilemma is not to be repeated: so there are no further negotiations based on what the other side chose.

More importantly, games with such restricting options and results are entered into voluntarily and can be avoided (we can argue that the prisoners chose to engage in the game in that they chose to commit a crime and hence ran the possibility of being caught!). Outside of games, agents affect each other and the outcomes in many different ways and can hence vary the outcomes as they interact – in real life, communication involves altering the perception of how the world works, the values attached to different decisions, and hence what ought to be done and what potential consequences may arise.

In summary, even within the confines of the Prisoner’s Dilemma the assumptions that differing options be offered to each such that their self-interest works against the other can be challenged logically, ethically and judicially. Firstly, the collective outcomes of the game can be changed by the game master to produce a socially and individually optimal solution – the numbers can be altered. Secondly, presenting such a dilemma to the prisoners can be considered ethically and judicially questionable as the final sentence that each gets is dependent on what another party says, rather than on the guilt and deserved punished of the individual.

Interestingly, repeated games tested by psychologists and economists tend to present a range of solutions depending on the stakes and other rules, with Axelrod’s findings (The Evolution of Cooperation, 1984) indicating that egotistic action can work for mutual harmony under the principle of “tit for tat” – i.e., an understanding that giving something each creates a better outcome for both.

At a deeper level, some egoists may reject the possibility of fixed or absolute values that individuals acting selfishly and caught up in their own pursuits cannot see. Nietzsche, for instance, would counter that values are created by the individual and thereby do not stand independently of his or her self to be explained by another “authority”; similarly, St. Augustine would say “love, and do as you will”; neither of which may be helpful to the prisoners above but which may be of greater guidance for individuals in normal life.

Rand exhorts the application of reason to ethical situations, but a critic may reply that what is rational is not always the same as what is reasonable. The critic may emphasize the historicity of choice, that is, she may emphasize that one’s apparent choice is demarcated by, and dependent on, the particular language, culture of right and consequence and environmental circumstance in which an individual finds herself living: a Victorian English gentleman perceived a different moral sphere and consequently horizon of goals than an American frontiersman. This criticism may, however, turn on semantic or contextual nuances. The Randian may counter that what is rational is reasonable: for one can argue that rationality is governed as much by understanding the context (Sartre’s facticity is a highly useful term) as adhering to the laws of logic and of non-contradiction.

b. Ethical Egoism

Ethical egoism is the normative theory that the promotion of one’s own good is in accordance with morality. In the strong version, it is held that it is always moral to promote one’s own good, and it is never moral not to promote it. In the weak version, it is said that although it is always moral to promote one’s own good, it is not necessarily never moral to not. That is, there may be conditions in which the avoidance of personal interest may be a moral action.

In an imaginary construction of a world inhabited by a single being, it is possible that the pursuit of morality is the same as the pursuit of self-interest in that what is good for the agent is the same as what is in the agent’s interests. Arguably, there could never arise an occasion when the agent ought not to pursue self-interest in favor of another morality, unless he produces an alternative ethical system in which he ought to renounce his values in favor of an imaginary self, or, other entity such as the universe, or the agent’s God. Opponents of ethical egoism may claim, however, that although it is possible for this Robinson Crusoe type creature to lament previous choices as not conducive to self-interest (enjoying the pleasures of swimming all day, and not spending necessary time producing food), the mistake is not a moral mistake but a mistake of identifying self-interest. Presumably this lonely creature will begin to comprehend the distinctions between short, and long-term interests, and, that short-term pains can be countered by long-term gains.

In addition, opponents argue that even in a world inhabited by a single being, duties would still apply; (Kantian) duties are those actions that reason dictates ought to be pursued regardless of any gain, or loss to self or others. Further, the deontologist asserts the application of yet another moral sphere which ought to be pursued, namely, that of impartial duties. The problem with complicating the creature’s world with impartial duties, however, is in defining an impartial task in a purely subjective world. Impartiality, the ethical egoist may retort, could only exist where there are competing selves: otherwise, the attempt to be impartial in judging one’s actions is a redundant exercise. (However, the Cartesian rationalist could retort that need not be so, that a sentient being should act rationally, and reason will disclose what are the proper actions he should follow.)

If we move away from the imaginary construct of a single being’s world, ethical egoism comes under fire from more pertinent arguments. In complying with ethical egoism, the individual aims at her own greatest good. Ignoring a definition of the good for the present, it may justly be argued that pursuing one’s own greatest good can conflict with another’s pursuit, thus creating a situation of conflict. In a typical example, a young person may see his greatest good in murdering his rich uncle to inherit his millions. It is the rich uncle’s greatest good to continue enjoying his money, as he sees fit. According to detractors, conflict is an inherent problem of ethical egoism, and the model seemingly does not possess a conflict resolution system. With the additional premise of living in society, ethical egoism has much to respond to: obviously there are situations when two people’s greatest goods – the subjectively perceived working of their own self-interest – will conflict, and, a solution to such dilemmas is a necessary element of any theory attempting to provide an ethical system.

The ethical egoist contends that her theory, in fact, has resolutions to the conflict. The first resolution proceeds from a state of nature examination. If, in the wilderness, two people simultaneously come across the only source of drinkable water a potential dilemma arises if both make a simultaneous claim to it. With no recourse to arbitration they must either accept an equal share of the water, which would comply with rational egoism. (In other words, it is in the interest of both to share, for both may enjoy the water and each other’s company, and, if the water is inexhaustible, neither can gain from monopolizing the source.) But a critic may maintain that this solution is not necessarily in compliance with ethical egoism. Arguably, the critic continues, the two have no possible resolution, and must, therefore, fight for the water. This is often the line taken against egoism generally: that it results in insoluble conflict that implies, or necessitates a resort to force by one or both of the parties concerned. For the critic, the proffered resolution is, therefore, an acceptance of the ethical theory that “might is right;” that is, the critic maintains that the resolution accepts that the stronger will take possession and thereby gain proprietary rights.

However, ethical egoism does not have to logically result in a Darwinian struggle between the strong and the weak in which strength determines moral rectitude to resources or values. Indeed, the “realist” position may strike one as philosophically inadequate as that of psychological egoism, although popularly attractive. For example, instead of succumbing to insoluble conflict, the two people could cooperate (as rational egoism would require). Through cooperation, both agents would, thereby, mutually benefit from securing and sharing the resource. Against the critic’s pessimistic presumption that conflict is insoluble without recourse to victory, the ethical egoist can retort that reasoning people can recognize that their greatest interests are served more through cooperation than conflict. War is inherently costly, and, even the fighting beasts of the wild instinctively recognize its potential costs, and, have evolved conflict-avoiding strategies.

On the other hand, the ethical egoist can argue less benevolently, that in case one man reaches the desired resource first, he would then be able to take rightful control and possession of it – the second person cannot possess any right to it, except insofar as he may trade with its present owner. Of course, charitable considerations may motivate the owner to secure a share for the second comer, and economic considerations may prompt both to trade in those products that each can better produce or acquire: the one may guard the water supply from animals while the other hunts. Such would be a classical liberal reading of this situation, which considers the advance of property rights to be the obvious solution to apparently intractable conflicts over resources.

A second conflict-resolution stems from critics’ fears that ethical egoists could logically pursue their interests at the cost of others. Specifically, a critic may contend that personal gain logically cannot be in one’s best interest if it entails doing harm to another: doing harm to another would be to accept the principle that doing harm to another is ethical (that is, one would be equating “doing harm” with “one’s own best interests”), whereas, reflection shows that principle to be illogical on universalistic criteria. However, an ethical egoist may respond that in the case of the rich uncle and greedy nephew, for example, it is not the case that the nephew would be acting ethically by killing his uncle, and that for a critic to contend otherwise is to criticize personal gain from the separate ethical standpoint that condemns murder. In addition, the ethical egoist may respond by saying that these particular fears are based on a confusion resulting from conflating ethics (that is, self-interest) with personal gain; The ethical egoist may contend that if the nephew were to attempt to do harm for personal gain, that he would find that his uncle or others would or may be permitted to do harm in return. The argument that “I have a right to harm those who get in my way” is foiled by the argument that “others have a right to harm me should I get in the way.” That is, in the end, the nephew variously could see how harming another for personal gain would not be in his self-interest at all.

The critics’ fear is based on a misreading of ethical egoism, and is an attempt to subtly reinsert the “might is right” premise. Consequently, the ethical egoist is unfairly chastised on the basis of a straw-man argument. Ultimately, however, one comes to the conclusion reached in the discussion of the first resolution; that is, one must either accept the principle that might is right (which in most cases would be evidentially contrary to one’s best interest), or accept that cooperation with others is a more successful approach to improving one’s interests. Though interaction can either be violent or peaceful, an ethical egoist rejects violence as undermining the pursuit of self-interest.

A third conflict-resolution entails the insertion of rights as a standard. This resolution incorporates the conclusions of the first two resolutions by stating that there is an ethical framework that can logically be extrapolated from ethical egoism. However, the logical extrapolation is philosophically difficult (and, hence, intriguing) because ethical egoism is the theory that the promotion of one’s own self-interest is in accordance with morality whereas rights incorporate boundaries to behavior that reason or experience has shown to be contrary to the pursuit of self-interest. Although it is facile to argue that the greedy nephew does not have a right to claim his uncle’s money because it is not his but his uncle’s, and to claim that it is wrong to act aggressively against the person of another because that person has a legitimate right to live in peace (thus providing the substance of conflict-resolution for ethical egoism), the problem of expounding this theory for the ethical egoist lies in the intellectual arguments required to substantiate the claims for the existence of rights and then, once substantiated, connecting them to the pursuit of an individual’s greatest good.

i. Conditional Egoism

A final type of ethical egoism is conditional egoism. This is the theory that egoism is morally acceptable or right if it leads to morally acceptable ends. For example, self-interested behavior can be accepted and applauded if it leads to the betterment of society as a whole; the ultimate test rests not on acting self-interestedly but on whether society is improved as a result. A famous example of this kind of thinking is from Adam Smith’s The Wealth of Nations, in which Smith outlines the public benefits resulting from self-interested behavior (borrowing a theory from the earlier writer Bernard Mandeville and his Fable of the Bees). Smith writes: "It is not from the benevolence of the butcher, the brewer, or the baker, that we expect our dinner, but from their regard to their own interest. We address ourselves, not to their humanity but to their self-love, and never talk to them of our own necessities but of their advantages" (Wealth of Nations, I.ii.2).

As Smith himself admits, if egoistic behavior lends itself to society’s detriment, then it ought to be stopped. The theory of conditional egoism is thus dependent on a superior moral goal such as an action being in the common interest, that is, the public good. The grave problem facing conditional egoists is according to what standard ought the limits on egoism be placed? In other words, who or what is to define the nature of the public good? If it is a person who is set up as the great arbitrator of the public, then it is uncertain if there can be a guarantee that he or she is embodying or arguing for an impartial standard of the good and not for his or her own particular interest. If it is an impartial standard that sets the limit, one that can be indicated by any reasonable person, then it behooves the philosopher to explain the nature of that standard.

In most “public good” theories, the assumption is made that there exists a collective entity over and above the individuals that comprise it: race, nation, religion, and state being common examples. Collectivists then attempt to explain what in particular should be held as the interest of the group. Inevitably, however, conflict arises, and resolutions have to be produced. Some seek refuge in claiming the need for perpetual dialogue (rather than exchange), but others return to the need for force to settle apparently insoluble conflicts; nonetheless, the various shades of egoism pose a valid and appealing criticism of collectivism: that individuals act; groups don’t. Karl Popper’s works on methodological individualism are a useful source in criticizing collectivist thinking (for example, Popper’s The Poverty of Historicism).

3. Conclusion

Psychological egoism is fraught with the logical problem of collapsing into a closed theory, and hence being a mere assumption that could validly be accepted as describing human motivation and morality, or be rejected in favor of a psychological altruism (or even a psychological ecologism in which all actions necessarily benefit the agent’s environment).

Normative egoism, however, engages in a philosophically more intriguing dialogue with protractors. Normative egoists argue from various positions that an individual ought to pursue his or her own interest. These may be summarized as follows: the individual is best placed to know what defines that interest, or it is thoroughly the individual’s right to pursue that interest. The latter is divided into two sub-arguments: either because it is the reasonable/rational course of action, or because it is the best guarantee of maximizing social welfare.

Egoists also stress that the implication of critics’ condemnation of self-serving or self-motivating action is the call to renounce freedom in favor of control by others, who then are empowered to choose on their behalf. This entails an acceptance of Aristotle’s political maxim that "some are born to rule and others are born to be ruled," also read as "individuals are generally too stupid to act either in their own best interests or in the interests of those who would wish to command them." Rejecting both descriptions (the first as being arrogant and empirically questionable and the second as unmasking the truly immoral ambition lurking behind attacks on selfishness), egoists ironically can be read as moral and political egalitarians glorifying the dignity of each and every person to pursue life as they see fit. Mistakes in securing the proper means and appropriate ends will be made by individuals, but if they are morally responsible for their actions they not only will bear the consequences but also the opportunity for adapting and learning. When that responsibility is removed and individuals are exhorted to live for an alternative cause, their incentive and joy in improving their own welfare is concomitantly diminished, which will, for many egoists, ultimately foster an uncritical, unthinking mass of obedient bodies vulnerable to political manipulation: when the ego is trammeled, so too is freedom ensnared, and without freedom ethics is removed from individual to collective or government responsibility.

Egoists also reject the insight into personal motivation that others – whether they are psychological or sociological "experts" – declare they possess, and which they may accordingly fine-tune or encourage to "better ends." Why an individual acts remains an intrinsically personal and private act that is the stuff of memoirs and literature, but how they should act releases our investigations into ethics of what shall define the good for the self-regarding agent.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Nichomachaean Ethics. Various translations available. Book IX being most pertinent.
  • Baier, Kurt. “Egoisim” in A Companion to Ethics. Ed. Peter Singer. Blackwell: Oxford. 1990.
  • Feinberg, Joel. “Psychological Egoism” in Ethics: History, Theory, and Contemporary Issues. Oxford University Press: Oxford. 1998.
  • Garvin, Lucius. A Modern Introduction to Ethics. Houghton Mifflin: Cambrirdge, MA, 1953.
  • Hargreaves-Heap, Shaun P. and Yanis Varoufakis. Game Theory: A Critical Introduction. Routledge: London, 1995.
  • Holmes, S.J. Life and Morals. MacMillan: London, 1948.
  • Hospers, John. “Ethical Egoism,” in An Introduction to Philosophical Analysis. 2nd Edition. Routledge, Kegan Paul: London, 1967.
  • Hume, David. Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals.
  • Peikoff, Leonard. Objectivism: The Philosophy of Ayn Rand. Meridian: London, 1993.
  • Popper, Karl. Poverty of Historicism. Routledge & Kegan Paul: London, 1976.
  • Rachels, James. Elements of Moral Philosophy. Mcgraw-Hill: London, 1995.
  • Rand, Ayn. Virtue of Selfishness. Signet: New York, 1964.
  • Rand, Ayn. The Fountainhead. Harper Collins: New York. 1961.
  • Sidgwick, Henry. The Methods of Ethics. MacMillan: London, 1901.
  • Smith, Adam. Wealth of Nations.
  • Smith, Adam. Theory of Moral Sentiments.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
United Kingdom

Stoic Philosophy of Mind

Stoicism was one of the most important and enduring philosophies to emerge from the Greek and Roman world. The Stoics are well known for their contributions to moral philosophy, and more recently they have also been recognized for their work in logic, grammar, philosophy of language, and epistemology. This article examines the Stoics' contributions to philosophy of mind. The Stoics constructed one of the most advanced and philosophically interesting theories of mind in the classical world. As in contemporary cognitive science, the Stoics rejected the idea that the mind is an incorporeal entity. Instead they argued that the mind (or soul) must be something corporeal and something that obeys the laws of physics. Moreover, they held that all mental states and acts were states of the corporeal soul. The soul (a concept broader than the modern concept of mind) was believed to be a hot, fiery breath [pneuma] that infused the physical body. As a highly sensitive substance, pneuma pervades the body establishing a mechanism able to detect sensory information and transmit the information to the central commanding portion of the soul in the chest. The information is then processed and experienced. The Stoics analyzed the activities of the mind not only on a physical level but also on a logical level. Cognitive experience was evaluated in terms of its propositional structure, for thought and language were closely connected in rational creatures. The Stoic doctrine of perceptual and cognitive presentation (phantasia) offered a way to coherently analyze mental content and intentional objects. As a result of their work in philosophy of mind the Stoics developed a rich epistemology and a powerful philosophy of action. Finally, the Stoics denied Plato's and Aristotle's view that the soul has both rational and irrational faculties. Instead, they argued that the soul is unified and that all the faculties are rational concluding that the passions are the result not of a distinct irrational faculty but of errors in judgement.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Philosophy of Mind and the Parts of Philosophy
  2. Philosophy of Mind and Stoic Physics
    1. The Substance of the Soul
    2. Pneuma and Tension, and the Scala naturae
    3. Death
    4. The Parts of the Soul
  3. Philosophy of Mind and Stoic Logic
    1. Presentation (phantasia), Memory, and Concept Formation
    2. Impulse, Assent, and Action
  4. Philosophy of Mind and Stoic Ethics
    1. Primary Impulse and Prolepsis
    2. Passion and Eupatheia
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Collections of Stoic texts
    2. Recommended Readings on Stoic Psychology

1. Introduction

Greek and Roman philosophers did not recognize philosophy of mind as a distinct field of study. However, topics now considered central to philosophy of mind such as perception, imagination, thought, intelligence, emotion, memory, identity, and action were often discussed under the title Peri psychês or On the Soul. This article surveys some of the ideas held by the ancient Stoics addressing the soul and related topics which roughly correspond to themes prevalent in contemporary philosophy of mind and philosophical psychology.

a. Philosophy of Mind and the Parts of Philosophy

The ancient Greek concept of soul differs in many ways from the modern (post-Cartesian) idea of mind. Contemporary thinkers tend to sharply contrast the mind and body. When we think of mind we think primarily of cognitive faculties and perhaps our sense of identity. The Greek concept of the soul is much broader and more closely connected to basic bodily functions. The soul is first and foremost the principle of life; it is that which animates the body. Although the soul accounts for our ability to think, perceive, imagine, and reason, it is also responsible for biological processes such as respiration, digestion, procreation, growth, and motion. Perhaps the closest we come to a Cartesian concept of the soul in ancient Greek thought would be Plato, the Pythagoreans, and their successors. Stoic psychology represents the other end of the spectrum: a corporeal or physicalist model of soul.

Since there is no clear subject in Stoicism corresponding to contemporary philosophy of mind, evidence must be gleaned from various departments of the Stoic philosophical system. The Stoics divided philosophy into three general "parts": Physics, Logic, and Ethics. Teachings regarding the soul can be found in all three parts. In physics the Stoics analyzed the substance of the soul, its relationship to God and the cosmos, and its role in the functioning of the human body. In logic the Stoics developed a theory of meaning and truth, both of which are dependent upon a theory of perception, thinking, and other psychological concepts. Here the Stoics developed a sophisticated theory of mental content and intentionality and wrestled with the ontological ramifications of such a theory. Finally, in ethics the Stoics developed a complex theory of emotion and a psychology of action that ultimately had a great impact on their moral philosophy. The development of one's cognitive faculties was believed to be inseparable from ethics. In short, Stoic psychology was central to Stoicism as a whole.

2. Philosophy of Mind and Stoic Physics

a. The Substance of the Soul

Zeno of Citium (335-263 BCE), the founder of Stoicism, was very interested in the nature of the soul. He and his protégé Cleanthes (331-232 BCE) emphasized the active nature of the mind by identifying it as an internal fire or vital heat. It was not until Chrysippus (c. 280-207 BCE) that Stoic psychology reached its mature state. According to Chrysippus, the human soul consists of a breath-like substance called pneuma. Cognitive faculties were identified with the specific activities of the pneuma. In addition to being the substance of the particular souls of living organisms, pneuma was also held to be the organizing principle of the cosmos, that is, the world-soul. The Stoics identified this world-soul with God or Zeus. One source described God as an intelligent, artistic fire that systematically creates the cosmos as it expands; in the same passage God is called a pneuma that pervades the whole cosmos as the human soul pervades the mortal body. In contrast to contemporary physics and cosmology, the Stoics saw the world as a living organism.

Stoic psychology is inseparable from Stoic physics and cosmology. The pneuma of the human soul (pneuma psychikon) is said to be a mixture of air and fire. Some Stoics saw this soul as a literal mixture of fire and air, others associated it with a refined fire (similar to aether) or vital heat. The pneuma permeating the body was held to be a portion of the divine pneuma permeating and directing the cosmos. The human soul is a portion of God within us, both animating us and endowing us with reason and intelligence.

The Stoics argued that the soul is a bodily (corporeal) substance. Although the soul is a body, it is best to avoid calling Stoic psychology materialist. The Stoics contrasted soul and matter. For this reason scholars generally prefer to call Stoic psychology corporealist, physicalist, or vitalist. Matter is but one of two principles underlying every bodily substance. These two principles are the active [to poioun] and the passive [to paschon]. Matter is identified with the passive principle. Its complement, the active principle, is reason [logos] or God and is held to extend through matter providing it with motion, form, and structure. Both principles are bodily or corporeal principles (that is, they occupy space and are causally efficient) but neither exists in isolation. Substances can be dominated by either principle; the more active the substance, the more rational and divine it is; the more passive, the more material.

The Stoics also made a distinction between principles [archai] and elements [stoicheia]. The basic elements are earth, water, air, and fire. Earth and water are heavy, passive elements, dominated by the passive principle. Air and fire, on the other hand, are active and closely connected with sentience and intelligence. The Stoics held that the soul is nourished from the exhalations from the passive elements. Biological bodies are distinguished from non-biological bodies by the presence of a specific kind of activity associated with the presence of the active elements in the body.

b. Pneuma and Tension, and the Scala naturae

Pneuma was the central theoretical tool of both Stoic physics and Stoic psychology. In contrast to the atomists, the Stoics argued for a continuum theory which denied the existence of void in the cosmos. The cosmos was seen as a single continuum of pneuma-charged substance. Qualitative difference between individual substances, such as between a rock and a pool of water, is determined by the degree of the tensional motion of the pneuma pervading the substance. Tensional motion [tonikê kinêsis] seems to be the motion of the pneuma in a body that simultaneously moves from the center to the surface and from the surface back to the center. Passive elements (earth and water) and dense bodies have a low degree of tensional activity, while active elements (fire and air) and the soul were seen to possess a high level of tensional motion. The Stoics organized all natural substances into different classes based on a hierarchy of powers or a scala naturae. The concept of tensional motion allowed the Stoics to have a unified physical theory based on pneuma, while at the same time having one that distinguished and explained the difference between organic and inorganic substances. Consequently Stoic physics showed that there exists a physical connection and continuity between mind and matter.

The Stoic scala naturae is a hierarchy of the powers in nature based on the activity and organization of the pneuma. Pneuma at its lowest level of organization and concentration produces simple cohesion in the matter in which it dwells; it holds together individual unified bodies. This state of cohesion and coherence is called hexis [cohesive state]. Bodies hold together on account of an internal flow of pneuma that begins at the center of the object extending to the surface and flowing back upon itself producing a tension from a two-way motion. Hence, even the most stable object possesses internal motion according to the Stoics. Wood and stones are example of things which possess hexis.

When the pneuma in a body is organized with a greater degree of activity, there is phusis or organic nature. Things that have phusis grow and reproduce but do not show signs of cognitive power. The pneuma that produces phusis also provides the stability or cohesion of hexis. The Stoics held that each power on this scala naturae subsumes the power below it. Plants are obvious examples of organisms that have both hexis and phusis but not soul.

The next tier of this hierarchy of pneumatic activity is soul [ psuchê]. The characteristic marks of this level of organization are the presence of impulse and perception. Non-rational animals have hexis [cohesive state], phusis [an organic nature], and psuchê [soul].

Only human beings and gods possess the highest level of pneumatic activity, reason [logos]. Reason was defined as a collection of conceptions and preconceptions; it is especially characterized by the use of language. In fact, the difference between how animals think and how humans think seems to be that human thinking is linguistic -- not that we must vocalize thoughts (for parrots can articulate human sounds), but that human thinking seems to follow a syntactical and propositional structure in the manner of language. The Stoics considered thinking in rational animals as a form of internal speech.

The Stoic hierarchy of pneuma should not be confused with Aristotle's theory of the hierarchy of the soul to which there is some resemblance. While the Stoic scala naturae explains both organic and inorganic substances, Aristotle's hierarchy is limited to biological organisms. Aristotle's theory is also based on a very different idea of soul.

The physical theory underlying Stoic psychology has some rather startling implications. For example, the Stoics held that active substances could pervade passive substances. Hence the soul, which is a body, is able to pervade the physical body. The soul does not pervade the body like the water in a sponge, that is, by occupying interstitial spaces; rather, the Stoics held that the corporeal pneuma occupied the exact same space as the passive matter, that is, both substances are mutually coextended [antiparektasis]. The soul permeates the body in the same way as heat pervades the iron rod, occupying the same space but being qualitatively distinct. The Stoics called this sort of mixture crasis or total blending.

Total blending should be contrasted with particulate mixture and fusion mixture. An example of a particulate mixture is the mixture of different kinds of seeds. Each seed remains unaffected by the mixture, only the distribution is altered. This is sometimes called juxtaposition. Fusion mixture occurs when the items mixed are physically altered and a new, single substance emerges. Once eggs, milk, yeast, and flour are mixed together a new substance is produced (bread). In contrast to fusion mixture, in total mixture or crasis the blended substances (such as water and wine) were held to retain their properties and in principle could be separated.

A particular and highly controversial characteristic of total blending is that for mutual coextension to occur, it is not necessary that both bodies be of the same in quantity. Thus Chrysippus provocatively claimed that in total blending a drop of wine could pervade (coextend through) the entire ocean. This is an explicit rejection of Aristotle's theory of mixture in De generatione et corruptione. The pneuma in active substances seems to have great elasticity and is able to exist in a very rarified form while maintaining distinct properties.

c. Death

The doctrine of pneuma and total blending allowed the Stoics to adopt Plato's definition of death as "the separation of the soul from the body." The Stoics, however, used this definition against Plato, arguing that since only physical things can separate from physical things, the soul must be corporeal. Since the soul pervades the body as a crasis type mixture, separation is possible. The separation seems to occur by a loosening of the tension of the soul. Sleep is said to be a kind of mild relaxing, whereas death is a total relaxing of the tension which results in the departure of the soul from the body.

Dying is not the end of a person's existence, according to the Stoics. Once the soul has separated from the body it maintains its own cohesion for a period of time. Chrysippus and Cleanthes disagreed regarding the fate of the soul after death. Cleanthes held that the souls of all men could survive until the conflagration, a time in which the divine fire totally consumes all matter. Chrysippus, on the other hand, held that only the souls of the wise are able to endure. The souls of the unwise will exist for a limited time before they are destroyed or reabsorbed into the cosmic pneuma. The souls of irrational beasts are destroyed with their bodies. In no case is there any indication that the survival of the soul after death had any direct benefit to the individual or that the Stoics used this as a motivator toward ethical or intellectual behavior. There is no heaven or hell in Stoicism; the time to live one's life and to perfect one's virtues is in the present.

d. The Parts of the Soul

The pneuma of the soul has a specific structure which helps account for its capacities. The Stoics held that the soul consists of eight parts which are spatially recognized portions or streams of pneuma. The eight parts of the soul are the five senses (sight, vision, smell, taste, touch), the reproductive faculty, the speech faculty, and the central commanding faculty [hêgemonikon]. All of the parts of the soul can be seen as extensions of pneuma originating in the hêgemonikon. Several analogies were employed to explain the structure of the soul: the soul is like an octopus, a tree, a spring of water, and even a spider's web. The analogies of the octopus, tree, and spring emphasize the unity of the soul and the idea that the individual powers or faculties are rooted in or sprout from the hêgemonikon in the heart. The Stoics, like Aristotle and Praxagoras of Cos, believed that the cognitive center is in the chest and not the head. These analogies are also consistent with Stoic views on embryological development; for the Stoics recognized that the heart is the first functioning organ of the fetus and held that the pneuma of the soul begins in the heart of the fetus and extends through the body, refining its powers as the fetus grows. The powers of sense perception, speech, and reproduction are extensions of the pneuma of the hêgemonikon which reaches its mature state as the child approaches adulthood.

Some have compared the Stoic contrast between the commanding faculty and the distal faculties to the modern distinction between the central and peripheral nervous systems. This comparison can be justified by the fact that the Stoics held that the higher cognitive functions and all cognitive experience take place exclusively in the hêgemonikon . While Aristotle seemed to be comfortable with attributing the experience of touch to the flesh and sight to the eyes, the Stoics tell us that the senses merely report the information to the central faculty where it is experienced and processed.

The idea of sensation as the transmission [diadosis] of sensory information is illustrated in the final two analogies of the soul. The first states that activity of the soul is like a king who sends out messengers. When the messengers acquire information they report it back to the king. Likewise, the hêgemonikon extends its pneuma to the sense organs, and when these in turn acquire sensory information, the pneuma transmits the information back to the heart. The second analogy states that the soul is like a spider in a web. When the web is disturbed by an insect the movement is transmitted through vibrations to the spider sitting at the center. The human soul in a like manner extends through the body like a sensory grid establishing a sensory tension [tonos]. All perceptual information is transmitted by a tensional motion [kinesis tonikê]. In the case of the senses of hearing and sight, the external medium between the sense organs and the sense object operates as an extension of the soul-pneuma. Air also contains a degree of tension which a sound disturbs like a pebble tossed into a calm pool; the sound is transmitted through the air and sends the auditory information in a spherical pattern. Once the tensional motion of the sound reaches the ears, the sound pattern is picked up by the pneuma of the body which in turn transmits the information to the hêgemonikon . Vision works similarly; the pneuma from the eyes interacts with external light to establish a cone shaped visual field. This tensed field can detect the shapes of the objects within as though by touch. Indeed all of the senses were thought to be forms of touch. Color was held to be a sort of surface texture on the object; apparently the Stoics held that each color had its own pattern of disturbance in the visual pneuma.

These analogies capture the relationship between the commanding faculty and the senses; they do not as effectively capture or explain the remaining two distal faculties: speech and reproduction. Whereas the senses are passive insofar as they receive the tensional motion of a sense object and communicate it to the command center, in the case of speech and reproduction the motion goes in the opposite direction. Speech is an expression and articulation of the tensional motion produced by the construction of thought in the hêgemonikon. Interestingly, it is the fact that speech is produced in conjunction with breath that Chrysippus used as a central argument for the location of the hêgemonikon in the heart and not the brain. Little survives on how the Stoics viewed the relationship between the commanding faculty and the reproductive faculty. Sources do tell us that seminal information which produces the child is drawn from the entire body of both parents; this is in contrast to the Aristotelian claim that the male parent contributes the form and the female the matter.

In addition to the eight parts of the soul, the human hêgemonikon itself was characterized by four basic powers: presentation [phantasia], impulse [hormê], assent [sugkatathesis], and reason [logos]. Iamblicus tells us that the eight parts of the soul differ in bodily substrata while the four powers of the hêgemonikon must be individuated by quality in regards to the same. In other words, the four powers of the hêgemonikon are not individually isolated in space; their identity seems to be characterized exclusively by their function.

3. Philosophy of Mind and Stoic Logic

a. Presentation (phantasia), Memory, and Concept Formation

The most basic power of the hêgemonikon is the ability to form presentations [phantasiai]. Other psychological states and activities such as mental assent, cognition, impulse, and knowledge are all either extensions or responses to presentations. Zeno defined a presentation as an imprinting [tupôsis] in the commanding faculty. He suggested that the soul is imprinted by the senses much in the same way as a signet ring imprints its shape in soft wax. At birth the hêgemonikon is said to be like a blank sheet of paper which is ready to receive writing; all our cognitive experience is drawn either directly or indirectly from sense experience, that is, empirically. Zeno held that the term phantasia comes from the word for light [phôs]. Like light, the presentation is said to reveal itself and its cause. Although few agree with his etymology, the report shows that Zeno saw the phantasia as containing two elements: the phenomenal experience of its object and the representational content (i.e. it represents an object in the world). The Stoics sometimes called the phantasia an affection [pathos] in the soul; this seems to emphasize that there is a qualitative experience inseparable from the representational information. When we see a red circle, we don't just acquire information, we also experience it as a red circle.

Chrysippus was not comfortable with the imprint analogy that Zeno and Cleanthes employed. Taken literally the analogy fails to capture the complexity of mental content. What kind of imprint would a color or sound make? How could the pneuma within the chest maintain and store such a rich collection of patterns and information? Chrysippus suggested that the imprinting metaphor must be abandoned and instead preferred to call presentations "alterations" [alloiôsis or heteroiôsis] of the hêgemonikon . He stated that just as the same air can be simultaneously altered by many sounds, maintaining each, so the hêgemonikon could retain such diverse and complex information. Although this is a far from satisfying solution, we should remember that contemporary philosophy of mind still has much work to do in explaining memory and concept retention.

The Stoics distinguished presentations drawn directly from the senses [aisthetike phantasiai] and those which are produced by the mind from previously experienced phantasiai. The doctrine of presentation also provided the foundation for a theory of memory and concept formation. Memory was seen to be stored phantasiai. Conceptions [ennoêmata] on the other hand seemed to be collections or patterns of stored phantasiai. The Stoic theory is flexible enough to account for real and fictional (intentional) objects, thereby establishing a plausible theory of imagination. The Stoics distinguished between phantasia, phantaston, phantastikon, and phantasma. The phantaston is the object producing the phantasia. A phantastikon is a phantasia which does not come from a real object, such as those produced by the imagination. Imagination was explained as the manipulation of mental content. By taking elements from stored experience and enlarging, shrinking, transposing, or negating parts of the phantasiai it is possible imagine monsters; thus one can produce mental content which has no real object. For example we can create a mermaid by transposing a body of a fish onto a young woman's torso. Although mermaids and monsters don't exist, we need to explain how non-existing things can be the object of thought and even produce desire or attraction. The Stoics did this by drawing a distinction between the imagined object (phantasma), i.e. the mermaid, and the mental construct (phantastikon), the thought of the mermaid. We are not attracted to the idea or mental image of the mermaid but to the intentional object of the idea, namely to the mermaid herself. Similar distinctions were pursued in the early 20th century by philosophers such as Meninong and Russell.

The Stoics made a further distinction in their doctrine of presentations: some presentations are rational, some are not. Rational presentations are limited to human beings and are said to be "thoughts" [noeseis]. Thoughts, like other phantasiai, are physical states of the soul-pneuma. The characteristic feature of a rational presentation seems to be its structure or syntax. Something is said about something, and consequently the thought now has meaning -- and if it is a proposition, it has a truth value associated with it. Simple thoughts, when expressed in language, have three elements: the object (thing signified), the sound (the signifier), and the linguistic/mental content (what is said). For example, in the sentence "The cat is black" the thing signified is the black cat; the signifier is the sounds of the words uttered; and finally the thing signified is the content of what is being said, namely, the claim regarding the color of a specific animal. The latter, the intelligible content of the statement, is called a lekton which is said to subsist with the rational presentation or thought; it is the content which is either true or false, not the object or the sound. A lekton is not a corporeal entity like a thought or the soul; it seems to be a theoretical entity which loosely corresponds to the contemporary notion of a proposition, a statement, or perhaps even the meaning of an utterance. It is the lekton that makes the sounds of a sentence to be more than just sounds. The doctrine of the lekta has generated much controversy in current scholarship and is recognized to be an important link between Stoic theory of mind and Stoic logic.

b. Impulse, Assent, and Action

Although we may entertain and experience all sorts of presentations, we do not necessarily accept or respond to them all. Hence the Stoics held that some phantasiai receive assent and some do not. Assent occurs when the mind accepts a phantasia as true (or more accurately accepts the subsisting lekton as true). Assent is also a specifically human activity, that is, it assume the power of reason. Although the truth value of a proposition is binary, true or false, there are various levels of recognizing truth. According to the Stoics, opinion (doxa) is a weak or false belief. The sage avoids opinions by withholding assent when conditions do not permit a clear and certain grasp of the truth of a matter. Some presentations experienced in perceptually ideal circumstances, however, are so clear and distinct that they could only come from a real object; these were said to be kataleptikê (fit to grasp). The kataleptic presentation compels assent by its very clarity and, according to some Stoics, represents the criterion for truth. The mental act of apprehending the truth in this way was called katalepsis which means having a firm epistemic grasp.

The idea of katalepsis as a firm grasp reappears in Zeno's famous analogy of the fist. According to Cicero, Zeno compared the phantasia to an open hand, assent, to a closing hand, the katalepsis, to a closed fist, and knowledge to a closed fist grasped by the other hand. Zeno's analogy however may be a little misleading if the reader assumes there to be a temporal succession and a series of discreet processes. Other evidence indicates that this is not the point of the analogy. For example, katalepsis was defined as a kind of assent, not as a discrete post-assent process. A katalepsis is an assent to a kataleptic presentation. Moreover knowledge [epistemê] was defined as a katalepsis that is secure and unchangeable by reason. The point of the fist analogy then seems to be that the central powers of the commanding faculty have different and progressively greater epistemic weight. The analogy emphasizes the epistemic progression from simple presentations to the systematic coherence of knowledge (it being confirmed by and consistent with other katalepseis); the analogy is not fundamentally about the discreteness of the psychological powers.

The emphasis on assent in Stoic psychology and epistemology is an important contribution to ancient philosophy. The Stoics used assent to indicate that a phantasia had been accepted by the mind. It also allows the agent to entertain a cognition while at the same time reject it. Indeed, philosophical prudence often demands that we withhold assent in cases of doubt. The introduction of assent as a distinct process provided a plausible way to explain how an agent may entertain a specific thought without necessarily accepting it.

In addition to epistemology, assent plays an important role in the Stoic theory of action. Presentational content often provokes an inclination to act by representing something as desirable. This kind of presentation was called phantasia hormetikê or impulse-generating presentation and was held to produce an impulse to act. The impulse is therefore a sort of call to action which is manifested as a motion of pneuma directed toward the specific organs of action.

The basic function of impulse is to initiate motion. When we perceive an object or event in the physical world, a phantasia or presentation is produced in the commanding faculty which is then evaluated by the rational faculty. Depending on the content of the presentation and the individual's conception of what is good, the object of perception may be classified as good, evil, or indifferent. Thefaculty of assent in conjunction with reason will accept, reject, or withhold judgement based on the value of the object. If the object is deemed good, an impulse is initiated as a kind of motion in the soul substratum. If the object is bad, repulsion [aphormê] is produced, and the agent withdraws from the object under consideration.

4. Philosophy of Mind and Stoic Ethics

a. Primary Impulse and Prolepsis

We have seen that the Stoics held that at birth the soul is free of experiential content. The Stoics, however, did not hold that this excluded the possibility that we are born with innate characteristics and psychological impulses. The most basic impulse found in new-born creatures is the impulse toward self-preservation. This is the primary human impulse and the starting point of Stoic ethics. This impulse is implanted by Nature and entails a certain consciousness of things appropriate to (or belonging to) the organism and of things alien or hostile to the creature. In contrast to the Epicureans, who held that the primary impulse was toward pleasure, the Stoics argued that the innate impulse toward self-regard and an awareness of one's own constitution was even more elementary. This innate impulse explains how animals naturally know how to use their limbs and defensive organs and why it is that animals naturally recognize predators as enemies.

Children and animals, however, are not rational; Nature must therefore supply the primary impulse as a foundation for behavior. In the case of animals the innate impulses explain a range of complex behavior, which in many cases appears intelligent. For example, the Stoics held that a spider does not possess rationality despite the apparently intelligent use of a web to catch insects. Primary impulses in animals are therefore identified with complex instincts. In the case of human beings, primary impulse is ideally a transitional mechanism. As children mature into adults, they develop rationality so that the impulse toward self-preservation falls under the scrutiny of reason. Rationality permits the agent to develop the notion of duty and virtue, which may at times take precedence over self-preservation. As the agent progresses in virtue and reason, children, family members, neighbors, fellow citizens, and finally all humankind are likewise seen as intrinsically valuable and incorporated into the agent's sphere of concern and interest. This process is called oikeiôsis or the doctrine of appropriation and is central to the Stoic ethics.

Also closely associated with the doctrine of the primary impulse is the Stoic doctrine of preconception [prolepsis]. A preconception is an innate disposition to form certain conceptions. The most frequently mentioned preconceptions are the concept of the good and the concept of God. Since the Stoics held that the soul is a blank sheet at birth, the preconception cannot be a specific cognition but only an innate disposition to form certain concepts.

b. Passion and Eupatheia

The final element of Stoic philosophy of mind to be presented in this article is the doctrine of the passions. Plato and Aristotle held that the soul had both rational and irrational parts and used this view to explain mental conflict. For example, the irrational "appetitive part" of the soul may desire a steady diet of rich and fatty foods. The rational part of the soul, however, will resist the demands of the irrational part since such a diet is unhealthy. The result is emotional conflict and in somecases moral conflict. Most Stoics (Posidonius being the most famous exception), in contrast, denied the existence of an irrational faculty. However, in order to explain the phenomenon of mental conflict, the Stoics developed a theory of passion which they believed could do the same work as Plato's or Aristotle's.

The Stoics defined passion in several ways, each emphasizing a different facet of the term. The four most common accounts or definitions of passion are:

  1. An excessive impulse.
  2. An impulse disobedient to (the dictates of) reason.
  3. A false judgement or opinion.
  4. A fluttering [ptoia] of the soul.

Each definition emphasizes a different aspect of passion. The first two definitions tell us that a passion is a kind of impulse. The first of these focuses on force. A passion is a runaway impulse or emotion. Chrysippus compared a passion to a person running downhill and unable to stop at will. The soul is carried away by the sheer force and strength of the impulse. Passions often develop a momentum that cannot easily be stopped. Some texts also emphasize that there is a temporal dimension to passion. The fresher the passion, the stronger the impulse; passions usually weaken over time.

The second and third definitions emphasize the logical side of passion. Passions are unruly and contrary to reason. They are based on mistaken thinking or false opinions. The fact that passions are irrational does not mean that they come from an irrational faculty. They can be errors produced by the rational faculty. Having a rational faculty does not imply infallibility. Rather, it implies that cognitive states are produced through an inferential process which operates with a syntax similar to language. Mathematics operates in a similar fashion. When we make mathematical errors, we do not appeal to a non-mathematic part of the soul which conflicts with the mathematical. Rather we attribute the error to a single, though limited and fallible, rational faculty. The Stoics saw passion in the same way. Passions are false judgements or mistakes in regards to the value of something and are thereby misdirected impulses. According to Stoic ethics, only virtues are truly good, whereas externals such as wealth, honor, power, and pleasure are indifferent to our happiness since each can also harm us and each ultimately lies beyond our control. These externals then are said to be morally "indifferent" (adiaphoron). When we mistakenly value something indifferent as though it were a genuine good, we form a false judgement and experience passion.

The traditional Stoic passions can be broken down into four different kinds or classes of errors in judgement. These errors concern the good and bad (value), and the present and the future (time):

Present Future
Good Pleasure Appetite
Bad Distress Fear

When one identifies something as good in the present when in fact it is not truly a good we have the passion called pleasure and its subspecies. When we do the same in the future we have appetite. Likewise when we misidentify something as bad in the present, we experience the passion called distress; when we err regarding something in the future we call it fear.

The fourth and final definition of passion as "a fluttering in the soul" is most likely a physical description of passion much as Aristotle describes anger as a boiling of blood around the heart. As corporealists, the Stoics frequently described activities as physical descriptions of the pneuma of the soul. The Stoics defined the individual passions as an irrational swelling or rising [heparsis]. When our impulses are excessive and unruly, the pneuma in one's chest canfeel like a fluttering. In contrast, Zeno described happiness, a state which presupposed rationality and virtue, as a smooth flowing soul. The fluttering may also signify the instability of passions as judgements. Chrysippus illustrated emotional disruption caused by the fluttering of passion with the example of Euripides' Medea, who continually flipped back and forth from one judgement to another.

These four definitions or descriptions of passion are in agreement though each emphasizes a different aspect of passion. For example, grief over lost or stolen property is considered a passion, a species of distress. Since the object of concern (the stolen property) is in truth of no moral worth (indifferent), for it is only our virtuous response to the situation that qualifies as morally good or bad, the impulse identified with the grief is excessive (1). Since we do not heed reason which would tell us that happiness lies in virtue alone, it is also an impulse disobedient to reason (2). Likewise, since the value attributed to an object does not represent its true worth, it is a false judgement (3). Finally, the distress which we experience in the grief manifests itself not as a smooth calm state but as a fluttering or disturbance in our soul (4).

If passions are excessive impulses and mistaken judgements resulting in emotional disquietude, there must also be appropriate impulses and correct judgements resulting in emotional peace. It is a mistake to assume that if the Stoics reject passion that they seek a life void of any emotion, that is, that they seek to be emotionally flat. A better reading of Stoicism is that the goal is not absence of emotion, but a well-disposed emotional life. This is a life in which impulses are rational, moderate, and held in check. It is a state in which one's impulses are appropriate to and consistent with the nature of things, both regarding the truth of the judgement and the degree of the response. This view is supported by the Stoic doctrine of the eupatheiai. Calling positive emotions "good-passions" may have been an attempt to rectify the misrepresentation of their school as being void of emotion. Examples of the eupatheiai are joy [khara], caution [eulabeia], and reasonable wishing [boulêsis]. Joy is said to be the counterpart of pleasure, caution is contrasted with fear, and reasonable wishing is contrasted with appetite. The difference is that in the eupatheiai the force of the impulse is appropriate to the value of the object, the impulse is consistent with rational behavior, and finally the belief or judgement regarding the nature of the object is true.

One should note that there are only three categories for the eupatheiai in contrast to the four for passions [é]. There is no eupatheia corresponding to distress. This is due to the Stoic conception of moral invincibility. Distress was defined as an incorrect judgement regarding a present evil. The Stoics, however, held that the good lies not in external events or objects but in the virtuous response of the moral agent to any situation. Since it is always possible to respond virtuously, there is no true evil in the present. The good is always possible here and now.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Collections of Stoic texts

  • Clark, Gordon H. (ed.). 1940. Selections From Hellenistic Philosophy. New York: Croft.
  • Edelstein, L. and Kidd, I. G. (eds.) 1972. Posidonius. The Fragments, 4 vols. Cambridge: University Press.
  • Hülser, Karlheinz. (ed.). 1987. Die Fragmente zur Dialektik der Stoiker. 4 vols. Stuttgart: Frommann-Holzboog.
  • Inwood, Brad and Gerson, L. P. (eds.). 1997. Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings, 2nd edition. Indianapolis: Hackett.
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  • von Arnim, Ioannes (ed.). 1903-1905. Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta. Leipzig: Teubner.

b. Recommended Readings on Stoic Psychology

  • Algra, Keimpe, et al. (eds.) 1999. The Cambridge History of Hellenistic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Annas, Julia. 1992. Hellenistic Philosophy of Mind. Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Arthur, E. P. 1983. "The Stoic analysis of the mind's reaction to presentations", Hermes 111: 69-78.
  • Brennan, Tad. 1996. "Reasonable Impressions in Stoicism", Phronesis 41.3: 318-334.
  • Brennan, Tad. 1998. "The Old Stoic Theory of Emotion", in Sihvola and Engberg-Pedersen (eds.) 1998: 21-70.
  • Brunschwig, Jacques. 1986. "The cradle argument in Epicureanism and Stoicism", in Schofield and Striker 1986: 113-144.
  • Brunschwig, Jacques. 1994. Papers in Hellenistic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Translated by Janet Lloyd.
  • Brunschwig, J. and Nussbaum, M. C. (eds.) 1993. Passions & Perceptions: studies in Hellenistic philosophy of mind. Proceedings of the Fifth Symposium Hellenisticum. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Caston, Victor. 1999. "Something and Nothing: The Stoics on concepts and universals" Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 17: 145-213.
  • Chiesa, M. C. 1991. "Le problème du langage intérieur chez les Stoïciens", Revue Internationale de Philosophie 3, 301-321.
  • Cooper, John. 1998. "Posidonius on Emotions", in Sihvola and Engberg-Pedersen, 1998: 71-112.
  • Doty, Ralph. 1992. The Criterion of Truth. American University Studies. Series V Philosophy, vol. 108. New York: Peter Lang.
  • Engberg-Pedersen, Troels. 1998. "Marcus Aurelius on Emotions", in Sihvola and Engberg-Pedersen, 1998: 305-338.
  • Everson, Stephen. 1990. Epistemology. Companions to Ancient Thought. Vol. 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Everson, Stephen. 1991. Psychology. Companions to Ancient Thought. Vol. 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Everson, Stephen. 1994. Language. Companions to Ancient Thought. Vol. 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Frede, Michael. 1983. "Stoics and Skeptics on clear and distinct impressions", in Essays in Ancient Philosophy. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota.: 65-93.
  • Frede, Michael. 1994. "The Stoic notion of lekton", in Everson 1994: 109-128.
  • Gill, Christopher. 1991. "Is there a concept of person in Greek philosophy?", in Everson 1991: 166-193.
  • Gill, Christopher. 1998. "Did Galen Understand Platonic and Stoic Thinking on Emotion", in Sihvola and Engberg-Pedersen, 1998: 113-148.
  • Glibert-Thirry, A. 1977. "La théorie stoïcienne de la passion chez Chrysippe et son évolution chez Posidonius", Revue philosophique de Louvain 75: 393-435.
  • Gould, J. 1970. The Philosophy of Chrysippus. Leiden: Brill.
  • Hahm, David E. 1977. The Origins of Stoic Cosmology. Columbus: Ohio State University Press.
  • Hahm, David E. 1978. "Early Hellenistic theories of vision and the perception of color", in Machamer & Turnbull 1978: 60-95.
  • Imbert, Claude. 1978. "Théorie de la representation et doctrine logique dans le stoicisme ancien", in Brunschwig 1978: 223-249.
  • Ingenkamp, Heinz Gerd. 1971. "Zur stoischen Lehre vom Sehen", Rheinisches Museum für Philologie 114: 240-246.
  • Inwood, Brad. 1985. Ethics and Human Action in Early Stoicism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Inwood, Brad. 1993. "Seneca and psychological dualism", in Brunschwig and Nussbaum 1993: 150-183.
  • Inwood, Brad. 1999. "Rules and Reasoning in Stoic Ethics", in Topics in Stoic Philosophy, Ierodikonou, Katerina (ed.): 95-127.
  • Ioppolo, Anna-Maria. 1990. "Presentation and assent: A physical and cognitive problem in early Stoicism", Classical Quarterly 40: 433-449.
  • Kerferd, George B. 1978. "The search for personal identity in Stoic thought", Bulletin of the John Ryland Library 55: 177-196.
  • Kerferd, George B. 1978. "The problem of synkathesis and katalepsis in Stoic doctrine", in Brunschwig 1978: 251-272.
  • Kidd, I.G. 1971. "Posidonius on Emotions" in Long 1971: 200-215.
  • Lesses, Glenn. 1998. "Content, Cause, and Stoic Impressions", Phronesis 43.1: 1-25.
  • Lewis, Eric. 1995. "The Stoics on identity and individuation", Phronesis 40: 89-108.
  • Lloyd, A.C. 1978. "Emotion and decision in Stoic psychology", in Rist 1978: 233-246.
  • Long, A. A. (ed.). 1971. Problems in Stoicism. London: Athlone Press.
  • Long, A. A. 1971. "Language and thought in Stoicism", in Long 1971: 75-113.
  • Long, A. A. 1974. Hellenistic Philosophy. 2nd ed. London: Duckworth.
  • Long, A. A. 1978. "The Stoic distinction between truth and the true", in Brunschwig 1978: 297-315.
  • Long, A. A. 1982. "Soul and Body in Stoicism", Phronesis 27: 34-57.
  • Long, A. A. 1991. "Representation and the self in Stoicism", 102-120 in Everson 1991.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. 1993. "Poetry and the passions: two Stoic views" in Brunschwig and Nussbaum 1993: 97-149.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. 1994. The Therapy of Desire: Theory and Practice in Hellenistic Ethics. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Modrak, Deborah K. 1993. "Stoics, Epicureans and mental content", Apeiron 26: 97-108.
  • Ostenfeld, Erik. 1987. Ancient Greek Psychology and the Modern Mind-Body Debate. Aarhus, Denmark: Aarhus University Press.
  • Pembroke, S. G. 1971. "Oikeiôsis", in Long 1971: 114-149.
  • Reale, Giovanni. 1990. A History of Ancient Philosophy, vol. 4. The Schools of the Imperial Age. Albany, NY: State University of New York Press. [Edited. & translated by John R. Catan].
  • Reesor, Margaret, E. 1989. The Nature of Man in Early Stoic Philosophy. London: Duckworth.
  • Rist, John M. 1969. Stoic Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Rist, John M. 1985. "On Greek biology, Greek cosmology and some sources of theological pneuma", Prudentia. The Concept of Spirit. Supplementary Number 1985, 27-47.
  • Rist, John M. (ed.). 1978. The Stoics. Berkeley, Los Angeles, and London: University of California Press.
  • Rorty, Amélie Oksenberg. 1998. "The Two Faces of Stoicism: Rousseau and Freud", in Sihvola and Engberg-Pedersen, 1998: 243-270.
  • Sakezles, Priscilla. 1998. "Aristotle and Chrysippus on the physiology of human action", Apeiron 31.2, 127-166.
  • Sandbach, F. H. 1971. "phantasia kataleptike", in Long 1971: 9-21.
  • Schofield, M., Burnyeat, M. and Barnes, J. (eds.). 1980. Doubt and Dogmatism: studies in Hellenistic epistemology. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Schofield, M. and Striker, G. (eds.). 1986. The Norms of Nature. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sedley, David. 1993. "Chrysippus on psychophysical causality", in Brunschwig and Nussbaum 1993: 313-331.
  • Sharples, R. W. 1996. Stoics, Epicureans, and Sceptics: An Introduction to Hellenistic Philosophy. London: Routledge.
  • Sihvola, Juha and Engberg-Pedersen, Troels (eds.) 1998. The Emotions in Hellenistic Philosophy. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Sorabji, Richard. 1990. "Perceptual content in the Stoics", Phronesis 35, 301-314.
  • Sorabji, Richard. Animal Minds & Human Morals. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Sorabji, Richard. 1998. "Chrysippus - Posidonius - Seneca: A High Level Debate on Emotion", in Sihvola and Engberg-Pedersen, 1998: 149-170.
  • Striker, Gisela. 1996. Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • von Staden, Heinrich. 1978. "The Stoic theory of perception and its 'Platonic' critics", 96-136 in Machamer & Turnbull 1978.
  • Watson, Gerard. 1988. "Discovering the imagination: Platonists and Stoics on phantasia", 208-233 in Dillon and Long 1988.
  • Watson, Gerard. 1994. "The concept of 'phantasia' from the late Hellenistic period to early Neoplatonism", Aufstieg und Niedergang der Römischen Welt (ANRW) II.36.7: 4765-4810.
  • Williams, Bernard. 1994. "Stoic Philosophy and the Emotions: reply to Richard Sorabji", Aristotle and After, 21-214.

Author Information

Scott Rubarth
Rollins College
U. S. A.

Chinese Room Argument

The Chinese room argument is a thought experiment of John Searle (1980a) and associated (1984) derivation. It is one of the best known and widely credited counters to claims of artificial intelligence (AI)---that is, to claims that computers do or at least can (someday might) think. According to Searle's original presentation, the argument is based on two key claims: brains cause minds and syntax doesn't suffice for semantics. Its target is what Searle dubs "strong AI." According to strong AI, Searle says, "the computer is not merely a tool in the study of the mind, rather the appropriately programmed computer really is a mind in the sense that computers given the right programs can be literally said to understand and have other cognitive states" (1980a, p. 417). Searle contrasts strong AI with "weak AI." According to weak AI, computers just simulate thought, their seeming understanding isn't real understanding (just as-if), their seeming calculation is only as-if calculation, etc. Nevertheless, computer simulation is useful for studying the mind (as for studying the weather and other things).

Table of Contents

  1. The Chinese Room Thought Experiment
  2. Replies and Rejoinders
    1. The Systems Reply
    2. The Robot Reply
    3. The Brain Simulator Reply
    4. The Combination Reply
    5. The Other Minds Reply
    6. The Many Mansions Reply
  3. Searle's "Derivation from Axioms"
  4. Continuing Dispute
    1. Initial Objections & Replies
    2. The Connectionist Reply
  5. Summary Analysis
  6. Postscript
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Chinese Room Thought Experiment

Against "strong AI," Searle (1980a) asks you to imagine yourself a monolingual English speaker "locked in a room, and given a large batch of Chinese writing" plus "a second batch of Chinese script" and "a set of rules" in English "for correlating the second batch with the first batch." The rules "correlate one set of formal symbols with another set of formal symbols"; "formal" (or "syntactic") meaning you "can identify the symbols entirely by their shapes." A third batch of Chinese symbols and more instructions in English enable you "to correlate elements of this third batch with elements of the first two batches" and instruct you, thereby, "to give back certain sorts of Chinese symbols with certain sorts of shapes in response." Those giving you the symbols "call the first batch 'a script' [a data structure with natural language processing applications], "they call the second batch 'a story', and they call the third batch 'questions'; the symbols you give back "they call . . . 'answers to the questions'"; "the set of rules in English . . . they call 'the program'": you yourself know none of this. Nevertheless, you "get so good at following the instructions" that "from the point of view of someone outside the room" your responses are "absolutely indistinguishable from those of Chinese speakers." Just by looking at your answers, nobody can tell you "don't speak a word of Chinese." Producing answers "by manipulating uninterpreted formal symbols," it seems "[a]s far as the Chinese is concerned," you "simply behave like a computer"; specifically, like a computer running Schank and Abelson's (1977) "Script Applier Mechanism" story understanding program (SAM), which Searle's takes for his example.

But in imagining himself to be the person in the room, Searle thinks it's "quite obvious . . . I do not understand a word of the Chinese stories. I have inputs and outputs that are indistinguishable from those of the native Chinese speaker, and I can have any formal program you like, but I still understand nothing." "For the same reasons," Searle concludes, "Schank's computer understands nothing of any stories" since "the computer has nothing more than I have in the case where I understand nothing" (1980a, p. 418). Furthermore, since in the thought experiment "nothing . . . depends on the details of Schank's programs," the same "would apply to any [computer] simulation" of any "human mental phenomenon" (1980a, p. 417); that's all it would be, simulation. Contrary to "strong AI," then, no matter how intelligent-seeming a computer behaves and no matter what programming makes it behave that way, since the symbols it processes are meaningless (lack semantics) to it, it's not really intelligent. It's not actually thinking. Its internal states and processes, being purely syntactic, lack semantics (meaning); so, it doesn't really have intentional (that is, meaningful) mental states.

2. Replies and Rejoinders

Having laid out the example and drawn the aforesaid conclusion, Searle considers several replies offered when he "had the occasion to present this example to a number of workers in artificial intelligence" (1980a, p. 419). Searle offers rejoinders to these various replies.

a. The Systems Reply

The Systems Reply suggests that the Chinese room example encourages us to focus on the wrong agent: the thought experiment encourages us to mistake the would-be subject-possessed-of-mental-states for the person in the room. The systems reply grants that "the individual who is locked in the room does not understand the story" but maintains that "he is merely part of a whole system, and the system does understand the story" (1980a, p. 419: my emphases).

Searle's main rejoinder to this is to "let the individual internalize all . . . of the system" by memorizing the rules and script and doing the lookups and other operations in their head. "All the same," Searle maintains, "he understands nothing of the Chinese, and . . . neither does the system, because there isn't anything in the system that isn't in him. If he doesn't understand then there is no way the system could understand because the system is just part of him" (1980a, p. 420). Searle also insists the systems reply would have the absurd consequence that "mind is everywhere." For instance, "there is a level of description at which my stomach does information processing" there being "nothing to prevent [describers] from treating the input and output of my digestive organs as information if they so desire." Besides, Searle contends, it's just ridiculous to say "that while [the] person doesn't understand Chinese, somehow the conjunction of that person and bits of paper might" (1980a, p. 420).

b. The Robot Reply

The Robot Reply - along lines favored by contemporary causal theories of reference - suggests what prevents the person in the Chinese room from attaching meanings to (and thus presents them from understanding) the Chinese ciphers is the sensory-motoric disconnection of the ciphers from the realities they are supposed to represent: to promote the "symbol" manipulation to genuine understanding, according to this causal-theoretic line of thought, the manipulation needs to be grounded in the outside world via the agent's causal relations to the things to which the ciphers, as symbols, apply. If we "put a computer inside a robot" so as to "operate the robot in such a way that the robot does something very much like perceiving, walking, moving about," however, then the "robot would," according to this line of thought, "unlike Schank's computer, have genuine understanding and other mental states" (1980a, p. 420).

Against the Robot Reply Searle maintains "the same experiment applies" with only slight modification. Put the room, with Searle in it, inside the robot; imagine "some of the Chinese symbols come from a television camera attached to the robot" and that "other Chinese symbols that [Searle is] giving out serve to make the motors inside the robot move the robot's legs or arms." Still, Searle asserts, "I don't understand anything except the rules for symbol manipulation." He explains, "by instantiating the program I have no [mental] states of the relevant [meaningful, or intentional] type. All I do is follow formal instructions about manipulating formal symbols." Searle also charges that the robot reply "tacitly concedes that cognition is not solely a matter of formal symbol manipulation" after all, as "strong AI" supposes, since it "adds a set of causal relation[s] to the outside world" (1980a, p. 420).

c. The Brain Simulator Reply

The Brain Simulator Reply asks us to imagine that the program implemented by the computer (or the person in the room) "doesn't represent information that we have about the world, such as the information in Schank's scripts, but simulates the actual sequence of neuron firings at the synapses of a Chinese speaker when he understands stories in Chinese and gives answers to them." Surely then "we would have to say that the machine understood the stories"; or else we would "also have to deny that native Chinese speakers understood the stories" since "[a]t the level of the synapses" there would be no difference between "the program of the computer and the program of the Chinese brain" (1980a, p. 420).

Against this, Searle insists, "even getting this close to the operation of the brain is still not sufficient to produce understanding" as may be seen from the following variation on the Chinese room scenario. Instead of shuffling symbols, we "have the man operate an elaborate set of water pipes with valves connecting them." Given some Chinese symbols as input, the program now tells the man "which valves he has to turn off and on. Each water connection corresponds to synapse in the Chinese brain, and the whole system is rigged so that after . . . turning on all the right faucets, the Chinese answer pops out at the output end of the series of pipes." Yet, Searle thinks, obviously, "the man certainly doesn't understand Chinese, and neither do the water pipes." "The problem with the brain simulator," as Searle diagnoses it, is that it simulates "only the formal structure of the sequence of neuron firings": the insufficiency of this formal structure for producing meaning and mental states "is shown by the water pipe example" (1980a, p. 421).

d. The Combination Reply

The Combination Reply supposes all of the above: a computer lodged in a robot running a brain simulation program, considered as a unified system. Surely, now, "we would have to ascribe intentionality to the system" (1980a, p. 421).

Searle responds, in effect, that since none of these replies, taken alone, has any tendency to overthrow his thought experimental result, neither do all of them taken together: zero times three is naught. Though it would be "rational and indeed irresistible," he concedes, "to accept the hypothesis that the robot had intentionality, as long as we knew nothing more about it" the acceptance would be simply based on the assumption that "if the robot looks and behaves sufficiently like us then we would suppose, until proven otherwise, that it must have mental states like ours that cause and are expressed by its behavior." However, "[i]f we knew independently how to account for its behavior without such assumptions," as with computers, "we would not attribute intentionality to it, especially if we knew it had a formal program" (1980a, p. 421).

e. The Other Minds Reply

The Other Minds Reply reminds us that how we "know other people understand Chinese or anything else" is "by their behavior." Consequently, "if the computer can pass the behavioral tests as well" as a person, then "if you are going to attribute cognition to other people you must in principle also attribute it to computers" (1980a, p. 421).

Searle responds that this misses the point: it's "not. . . how I know that other people have cognitive states, but rather what it is that I am attributing when I attribute cognitive states to them. The thrust of the argument is that it couldn't be just computational processes and their output because the computational processes and their output can exist without the cognitive state" (1980a, p. 420-421: my emphases).

f. The Many Mansions Reply

The Many Mansions Reply suggests that even if Searle is right in his suggestion that programming cannot suffice to cause computers to have intentionality and cognitive states, other means besides programming might be devised such that computers may be imbued with whatever does suffice for intentionality by these other means.

This too, Searle says, misses the point: it "trivializes the project of Strong AI by redefining it as whatever artificially produces and explains cognition" abandoning "the original claim made on behalf of artificial intelligence" that "mental processes are computational processes over formally defined elements." If AI is not identified with that "precise, well defined thesis," Searle says, "my objections no longer apply because there is no longer a testable hypothesis for them to apply to" (1980a, p. 422).

3. Searle's "Derivation from Axioms"

Besides the Chinese room thought experiment, Searle's more recent presentations of the Chinese room argument feature - with minor variations of wording and in the ordering of the premises - a formal "derivation from axioms" (1989, p. 701). The derivation, according to Searle's 1990 formulation proceeds from the following three axioms (1990, p. 27):

(A1) Programs are formal (syntactic).
(A2) Minds have mental contents (semantics).
(A3) Syntax by itself is neither constitutive of nor sufficient for semantics.

to the conclusion:

(C1) Programs are neither constitutive of nor sufficient for minds.

Searle then adds a fourth axiom (p. 29):

(A4) Brains cause minds.

from which we are supposed to "immediately derive, trivially" the conclusion:

(C2) Any other system capable of causing minds would have to have causal powers (at least) equivalent to those of brains.

whence we are supposed to derive the further conclusions:

(C3) Any artifact that produced mental phenomena, any artificial brain, would have to be able to duplicate the specific causal powers of brains, and it could not do that just by running a formal program.
(C4) The way that human brains actually produce mental phenomena cannot be solely by virtue of running a computer program.

On the usual understanding, the Chinese room experiment subserves this derivation by "shoring up axiom 3" (Churchland & Churchland 1990, p. 34).

4. Continuing Dispute

To call the Chinese room controversial would be an understatement. Beginning with objections published along with Searle's original (1980a) presentation, opinions have drastically divided, not only about whether the Chinese room argument is cogent; but, among those who think it is, as to why it is; and, among those who think it is not, as to why not. This discussion includes several noteworthy threads.

a. Initial Objections & Replies

Initial Objections & Replies to the Chinese room argument besides filing new briefs on behalf of many of the forenamed replies(for example, Fodor 1980 on behalf of "the Robot Reply") take, notably, two tacks. One tack, taken by Daniel Dennett (1980), among others, decries the dualistic tendencies discernible, for instance, in Searle's methodological maxim "always insist on the first-person point of view" (Searle 1980b, p. 451). Another tack notices that the symbols Searle-in-the-room processes are not meaningless ciphers, they're Chinese inscriptions. So they are meaningful; and so is Searle's processing of them in the room; whether he knows it or not.

In reply to this second sort of objection, Searle insists that what's at issue here is intrinsic intentionality in contrast to the merely derived intentionality of inscriptions and other linguistic signs. Whatever meaning Searle-in-the-room's computation might derive from the meaning of the Chinese symbols which he processes will not be intrinsic to the process or the processor but "observer relative," existing only in the minds of beholders such as the native Chinese speakers outside the room. "Observer-relative ascriptions of intentionality are always dependent on the intrinsic intentionality of the observers" (Searle 1980b, pp. 451-452). The nub of the experiment, according to Searle's attempted clarification, then, is this: "instantiating a program could not be constitutive of intentionality, because it would be possible for an agent [e.g., Searle-in-the-room] to instantiate the program and still not have the right kind of intentionality" (Searle 1980b, pp. 450-451: my emphasis); the intrinsic kind. Though Searle unapologetically identifies intrinsic intentionality with conscious intentionality, still he resists Dennett's and others' imputations of dualism. Given that what it is we're attributing in attributing mental states is conscious intentionality, Searle maintains, insistence on the "first-person point of view" is warranted; because "the ontology of the mind is a first-person ontology": "the mind consists of qualia [subjective conscious experiences] . . . right down to the ground" (1992, p. 20). This thesis of Ontological Subjectivity, as Searle calls it in more recent work, is not, he insists, some dualistic invocation of discredited "Cartesian apparatus" (Searle 1992, p. xii), as his critics charge; it simply reaffirms commonsensical intuitions that behavioristic views and their functionalistic progeny have, for too long, highhandedly, dismissed. This commonsense identification of thought with consciousness, Searle maintains, is readily reconcilable with thoroughgoing physicalism when we conceive of consciousness as both caused by and realized in underlying brain processes. Identification of thought with consciousness along these lines, Searle insists, is not dualism; it might more aptly be styled monist interactionism (1980b, p. 455-456) or (as he now prefers) "biological naturalism" (1992, p. 1).

b. The Connectionist Reply

The Connectionist Reply (as it might be called) is set forth---along with a recapitulation of the Chinese room argument and a rejoinder by Searle---by Paul and Patricia Churchland in a 1990 Scientific American piece. The Churchlands criticize the crucial third "axiom" of Searle's "derivation" by attacking his would-be supporting thought experimental result. This putative result, they contend, gets much if not all of its plausibility from the lack of neurophysiological verisimilitude in the thought-experimental setup. Instead of imagining Searle working alone with his pad of paper and lookup table, like the Central Processing Unit of a serial architecture machine, the Churchlands invite us to imagine a more brainlike connectionist architecture. Imagine Searle-in-the-room, then, to be just one of very many agents, all working in parallel, each doing their own small bit of processing (like the many neurons of the brain). Since Searle-in-the-room, in this revised scenario, does only a very small portion of the total computational job of generating sensible Chinese replies in response to Chinese input, naturally he himself does not comprehend the whole process; so we should hardly expect him to grasp or to be conscious of the meanings of the communications he is involved, in such a minor way, in processing.

Searle counters that this Connectionist Reply---incorporating, as it does, elements of both systems and brain-simulator replies---can, like these predecessors, be decisively defeated by appropriately tweaking the thought-experimental scenario. Imagine, if you will, a Chinese gymnasium, with many monolingual English speakers working in parallel, producing output indistinguishable from that of native Chinese speakers: each follows their own (more limited) set of instructions in English. Still, Searle insists, obviously, none of these individuals understands; and neither does the whole company of them collectively. It's intuitively utterly obvious, Searle maintains, that no one and nothing in the revised "Chinese gym" experiment understands a word of Chinese either individually or collectively. Both individually and collectively, nothing is being done in the Chinese gym except meaningless syntactic manipulations from which intentionality and consequently meaningful thought could not conceivably arise.

5. Summary Analysis

Searle's Chinese Room experiment parodies the Turing test, a test for artificial intelligence proposed by Alan Turing (1950) and echoing René Descartes' suggested means for distinguishing thinking souls from unthinking automata. Since "it is not conceivable," Descartes says, that a machine "should produce different arrangements of words so as to give an appropriately meaningful answer to whatever is said in its presence, as even the dullest of men can do" (1637, Part V), whatever has such ability evidently thinks. Turing embodies this conversation criterion in a would-be experimental test of machine intelligence; in effect, a "blind" interview. Not knowing which is which, a human interviewer addresses questions, on the one hand, to a computer, and, on the other, to a human being. If, after a decent interval, the questioner is unable to tell which interviewee is the computer on the basis of their answers, then, Turing concludes, we would be well warranted in concluding that the computer, like the person, actually thinks. Restricting himself to the epistemological claim that under the envisaged circumstances attribution of thought to the computer is warranted, Turing himself hazards no metaphysical guesses as to what thought is - proposing no definition or no conjecture as to the essential nature thereof. Nevertheless, his would-be experimental apparatus can be used to characterize the main competing metaphysical hypotheses here in terms their answers to the question of what else or what instead, if anything, is required to guarantee that intelligent-seeming behavior really is intelligent or evinces thought. Roughly speaking, we have four sorts of hypotheses here on offer. Behavioristic hypotheses deny that anything besides acting intelligent is required. Dualistic hypotheses hold that, besides (or instead of) intelligent-seeming behavior, thought requires having the right subjective conscious experiences. Identity theoretic hypotheses hold it to be essential that the intelligent-seeming performances proceed from the right underlying neurophysiological states. Functionalistic hypotheses hold that the intelligent-seeming behavior must be produced by the right procedures or computations.

The Chinese experiment, then, can be seen to take aim at Behaviorism and Functionalism as a would-be counterexample to both. Searle-in-the-room behaves as if he understands Chinese; yet doesn't understand: so, contrary to Behaviorism, acting (as-if) intelligent does not suffice for being so; something else is required. But, contrary to Functionalism this something else is not - or at least, not just - a matter of by what underlying procedures (or programming) the intelligent-seeming behavior is brought about: Searle-in-the-room, according to the thought-experiment, may be implementing whatever program you please, yet still be lacking the mental state (e.g., understanding Chinese) that his behavior would seem to evidence. Thus, Searle claims, Behaviorism and Functionalism are utterly refuted by this experiment; leaving dualistic and identity theoretic hypotheses in control of the field. Searle's own hypothesis of Biological Naturalism may be characterized sympathetically as an attempt to wed - or unsympathetically as an attempt to waffle between - the remaining dualistic and identity-theoretic alternatives.

6. Postscript

Debate over the Chinese room thought experiment - while generating considerable heat - has proven inconclusive. To the Chinese room's champions - as to Searle himself - the experiment and allied argument have often seemed so obviously cogent and decisively victorious that doubts professed by naysayers have seemed discreditable and disingenuous attempts to salvage "strong AI" at all costs. To the argument's detractors, on the other hand, the Chinese room has seemed more like "religious diatribe against AI, masquerading as a serious scientific argument" (Hofstadter 1980, p. 433) than a serious objection. Though I am with the masquerade party, a full dress criticism is, perhaps, out of place here (see Hauser 1993 and Hauser 1997). I offer, instead, the following (hopefully, not too tendentious) observations about the Chinese room and its neighborhood.

(1) Though Searle himself has consistently (since 1984) fronted the formal "derivation from axioms," general discussion continues to focus mainly on Searle's striking thought experiment. This is unfortunate, I think. Since intuitions about the experiment seem irremediably at loggerheads, perhaps closer attention to the derivation could shed some light on vagaries of the argument (see Hauser 1997).

(2) The Chinese room experiment, as Searle himself notices, is akin to "arbitrary realization" scenarios of the sort suggested first, perhaps, by Joseph Weizenbaum (1976, Ch. 2), who "shows in detail how to construct a computer using a roll of toilet paper and a pile of small stones" (Searle 1980a, p. 423). Such scenarios are also marshaled against Functionalism (and Behaviorism en passant) by others, perhaps most famously, by Ned Block (1978). Arbitrary realizations imagine would-be AI-programs to be implemented in outlandish ways: collective implementations (e.g., by the population of China coordinating their efforts via two-way radio communications), imagine programs implemented by groups; Rube Goldberg implementations (e.g., Searle's water pipes or Weizenbaum's toilet paper roll and stones), imagine programs implemented bizarrely, in "the wrong stuff." Such scenarios aim to provoke intuitions that no such thing - no such collective or no such ridiculous contraption - could possibly be possessed of mental states. This, together with the premise - generally conceded by Functionalists - that programs might well be so implemented, yields the conclusion that computation, the "right programming" does not suffice for thought; the programming must be implemented in "the right stuff." Searle concludes similarly that what the Chinese room experiment shows is that "[w]hat matters about brain operations is not the formal shadow cast by the sequences of synapses but rather the actual properties of the synapses" (1980, p. 422), their "specific biochemistry" (1980, p. 424).

(3) Among those sympathetic to the Chinese room, it is mainly its negative claims - not Searle's positive doctrine - that garner assent. The positive doctrine - "biological naturalism," is either confused (waffling between identity theory and dualism) or else it just is identity theory or dualism.

(4) Since Searle argues against identity theory, on independent grounds, elsewhere (e.g., 1992, Ch. 5); and since he acknowledges the possibility that some "specific biochemistry" different than ours might suffice to produce conscious experiences and consequently intentionality (in Martians, say), and speaks unabashedly of "ontological subjectivity" (see, e.g., Searle 1992, p. 100); it seems most natural to construe Searle's positive doctrine as basically dualistic, specifically as a species of "property dualism" such as Thomas Nagel (1974, 1986) and Frank Jackson (1982) espouse. Nevertheless, Searle frequently and vigorously protests that he is not any sort of dualist. Perhaps he protests too much.

(5) If Searle's positive views are basically dualistic - as many believe - then the usual objections to dualism apply, other-minds troubles among them; so, the "other-minds" reply can hardly be said to "miss the point." Indeed, since the question of whether computers (can) think just is an other-minds question, if other minds questions "miss the point" it's hard to see how the Chinese room speaks to the issue of whether computers really (can) think at all.

(6) Confusion on the preceding point is fueled by Searle's seemingly equivocal use of the phrase "strong AI" to mean, on the one hand, computers really do think, and on the other hand, thought is essentially just computation. Even if thought is not essentially just computation, computers (even present-day ones), nevertheless, might really think. That their behavior seems to evince thought is why there is a problem about AI in the first place; and if Searle's argument merely discountenances theoretic or metaphysical identification of thought with computation, the behavioral evidence - and consequently Turing's point - remains unscathed. Since computers seem, on the face of things, to think, the conclusion that the essential nonidentity of thought with computation would seem to warrant is that whatever else thought essentially is, computers have this too; not, as Searle maintains, that computers' seeming thought-like performances are bogus. Alternately put, equivocation on "Strong AI" invalidates the would-be dilemma that Searle's intitial contrast of "Strong AI" to "Weak AI" seems to pose:

Strong AI (they really do think) or Weak AI (it's just simulation).
Not Strong AI (by the Chinese room argument).
Therefore, Weak AI.

To show that thought is not just computation (what the Chinese room -- if it shows anything -- shows) is not to show that computers' intelligent seeming performances are not real thought (as the "strong" "weak" dichotomy suggests) .

7. References and Further Reading

  • Block, Ned. 1978. "Troubles with Functionalism." In C. W. Savage, ed., Perception and Cognition: Issues in the Foundations of Psychology, Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol. 9, 261-325. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Churchland, Paul, and Patricia Smith Churchland. 1990. "Could a machine think?" Scientific American 262(1, January): 32-39.
  • Dennett, Daniel. 1980. "The milk of human intentionality." Behavioral and Brain Sciences 3: 429-430.
  • Descartes, René. 1637. Discourse on method. Trans. John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff and Dugald Murdoch. In The philosophical writings of Descartes, Vol. I, 109-151. New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry. 1980. "Searle on what only brains can do." Behavioral and Brain Sciences 3: 431-432.
  • Hauser, Larry. 1993. Searle's Chinese Box: The Chinese Room Argument and Artificial Intelligence. East Lansing, Michigan: Michigan State University (Doctoral Dissertation). URL =
  • Hauser, Larry. 1997. "Searle's Chinese Box: Debunking the Chinese Room Argument." Minds and Machines, Volume 7, Number 2, pp. 199-226. URL =
  • Jackson, Frank. 1982. "Epiphenomenal qualia." Philosophical Quarterly 32:127-136.
  • Nagel, Thomas. 1974. What is it like to be a bat? Philosophical Review 83:435-450.
  • Nagel, Thomas. 1986. The View from Nowhere. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Schank, Roger C., and Robert P. Abelson. 1977. Scripts, Plans, Goals, and Understanding. Hillsdale, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum Press.
  • Searle, John. 1980a. "Minds, Brains, and Programs." Behavioral and Brain Sciences 3, 417-424.
  • Searle, John. 1980b. "Intrinsic Intentionality." Behavioral and Brain Sciences 3: 450-456.
  • Searle, John. 1984. Minds, Brains, and Science. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Searle, John. 1989. "Reply to Jacquette." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research XLIX: 701-708.
  • Searle, John. 1990. "Is the Brain's Mind a Computer Program?" Scientific American 262: 26-31.
  • Searle, John. 1992. The Rediscovery of the Mind, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Turing, Alan. 1950. "Computing Machinery and Intelligence." Mind LIX: 433-460.
  • Weizenbaum, Joseph. 1976. Computer Power and Human Reason. San Francisco: W. H. Freeman.

Author Information

Larry Hauser
Alma College
U. S. A.

Imagery and Imagination

imageryBoth imagery and imagination play an important part in our mental lives. This article, which has three main sections, discusses both of these phenomena, and the connection between them. The first part discusses mental images and, in particular, the dispute about their representational nature that has become known as the imagery debate. The second part turns to the faculty of the imagination, discussing the long philosophical tradition linking mental imagery and the imagination—a tradition that came under attack in the early part of the twentieth century with the rise of behaviorism. Finally, the third part of this article examines modal epistemology, where the imagination has been thought to serve an important philosophical function, namely, as a guide to possibility.

Table of Contents

  1. The Imagery Debate
    1. Two Views About Mental Images: Pictorialism vs. Descriptionalism
    2. The Argument from Introspection
    3. Objections to Pictorialism
    4. A Remaining Question About Pictorial vs. Descriptional Representation
  2. Accounts of Imagination
    1. Image-Based Theories
    2. Non-Image-Based Theories
  3. Imagination and Possibility
  4. References and Further Reading

1. The Imagery Debate

Consider the following list of questions:

  • What shape are a beagle’s ears?
  • How many windows are in your bedroom?
  • Which is a darker shade of green, a pine tree or a frozen pea?
  • When a person stands up straight, which is higher, her navel or her wrist?
  • If the letter D is turned on its back and put on top of a J, what does the combination remind you of?

When attempting to answer these questions, which are adapted from Pinker (1997) and Kosslyn (1995), you undoubtedly produced mental imagery—images of beagles, of windows, and of peas. For some of these questions, you probably had to produce two different images to compare to one another, while for some of the other questions, you probably had to rotate the image you produced from the orientation at which it started. These tasks probably also seemed routine—the production and manipulation of mental images are common aspects of our mental lives. But what are these mental images? What role do they play in our mental life? In attempting to answer these questions, philosophers and cognitive scientists have given two very different sorts of answer.

a. Two Views About Mental Images: Pictorialism vs. Descriptionalism

We are naturally inclined to think of mental images as analogous to non-mental images. Consider, for example, my mental image of the Grand Canyon and a photograph of the Grand Canyon. Intuitively, the two are similar sorts of representations. Both are pictures—only the latter is in a frame while the former is in my head.

This view of mental images, commonly referred to as pictorialism, is defended most prominently by Fodor (1975) and Kosslyn (1980). (See also Kosslyn and Pomerantz 1977.) In addition to its intuitive attractiveness, pictorialism derives support from various empirical experiments concerning mental image rotation and scanning (Shepard and Metzler 1971; Kosslyn 1973; Shepard and Cooper 1982). In one such experiment, subjects were asked to identify whether a pair of figures, such as letters, digits, or block formations, were identical or different. In each pair, the second figure had been rotated to an orientation different from the first. The experimenters discovered that subjects’ response times varied directly with the degree of rotation between the figures, a finding that suggests that the subjects were mentally rotating images of the objects.

Despite this intuitive and empirical support, however, pictorialism runs into trouble in its attempt to account for the mental pictures (or, at least, the quasi-pictures—see Kosslyn 1980) that it posits. If such pictures are non-physical, then they are not made of the right sort of “stuff” for use in a scientific conception of the mind. In order to avoid dualism, then, the pictorialist seems forced to suppose that these pictures in the head are located in the brain. Unfortunately, this supposition is also problematic, as it is not clear that there are any structures in the brain that could plausibly be construed as these physical pictures.

Motivated in large part by such worries, many philosophers and other researchers in contemporary cognitive science advocate an alternative view called descriptionalism. Among its most prominent defenders are Dennett (1969, 1979) and Pylyshyn (1973, 1978). While pictorialists claim that mental images represent roughly in the way that pictures represent, descriptionalists claim that they represent roughly in the way that language represents. Consider a state of affairs where George W. Bush is seated to the right of Dick Cheney. One way to represent this situation is by drawing a picture of Bush and Cheney with Bush sitting to Cheney’s right. As we have seen, pictorialists claim that this provides us with a model for the way that mental images represent. But another way to represent the same state of affairs is with a sentence such as, “George W. Bush is sitting to the right of Dick Cheney.” Descriptionalists claim that this provides a better model for the way that mental images represent.

Natural language descriptions, however, are by no means the only kind of representations that count as descriptional in the sense intended by descriptionalists. In fact, for the descriptionalists, a representation can count as descriptional even if it is not literally descriptive of the states of affairs represented. Consider one such representation: the binary language of a computer. In a computational system, a particular string of 0s and 1s might represent the above state of affairs. Alternatively, consider a representation of this state of affairs that proceeds by defining a certain operator, the “RIGHT-OF” operator, that takes an ordered argument pair: RIGHT-OF(George W. Bush, Dick Cheney). Like the sentence “George W. Bush is sitting to the right of Dick Cheney,” the binary representation and the operator representation are clearly not pictorial in nature. One important reason is that these representations do not look like what they represent. What sets pictorial representations apart from other representations is that they represent in virtue of having at least one visual characteristic (e.g., form, shape, or color) in common with what they represent. So, for example, though a black-and-white photograph can represent a pumpkin pictorially, a drawing of a purple triangle cannot.

The dispute between the pictorialists and the descriptionalists, known as the imagery debate, has generated considerable controversy and discussion in the last thirty years. As we have seen, the imagery debate concerns the representative nature of mental images. The descriptionalists challenge the pictorialists’ claim that mental images represent in a pictorial way. Unfortunately, the imagery debate is commonly mischaracterized as a debate over the existence of mental images. Descriptionalists are often taken to be denying the existence of mental images, while pictorialists are often taken to be defending their existence. (See Block 1981a for discussion of this mischaracterization.) The situation is exacerbated by the very participants in the debate, who themselves often obfuscate the issue between them. Dennett (1979) describes the debate as “a war between the believers and the skeptics, the lovers of mental images ... and those who decry or deny them,” and he frequently puts his own position in terms of “abandoning” mental images. Likewise, Fodor (1975) cites empirical studies in an effort to “argue forcibly for the psychological reality of images.” The pictorialist, however, should really be seen as arguing for the psychological reality of pictorial representation, which is also what the descriptionalist should be seen as abandoning.

b. The Argument from Introspection

It is also important to note that the imagery debate is not a debate over whether we “think in words” or “think in images.” To see this, it will be useful to consider the argument from introspection that is directed at descriptionalism. When we introspect, it seems to us that our mental images look like what they represent. This introspective judgment is often taken as definitive support for pictorialism, since pictorial representations look like what they represent while descriptional representations do not.

Block (1983) and Tye (1991) each argue persuasively that this argument should be rejected. Properly understood, the evidence from introspection can be seen to be neutral with respect to the imagery debate. To see this, we need to distinguish the experience of imaging from the representation that underlies or accounts for this experience. Consider the following analogy: Suppose you were to come across a box on whose surface was displayed a crude black and white image of a rabbit in a meadow. You might then ask: What is going on inside this box to account for the rabbit-image? One possibility is that some sort of slide projector inside the box projects the rabbit-image onto the box’s surface. If this were the case, then what underlies the image would be a pictorial process. But another possibility is that a computer inside the box produces the rabbit-image by way of binary code – strings of 0s and 1s that turn certain pixels on the surface of the box to black, certain pixels to gray, and so on, such that the rabbit image appears. If this were the case, then what underlies the image would be a non-pictorial process.

As this analogy suggests, the pictorialists claim that underlying the experience of mental imagery is some sort of representation that is pictorial in nature while the descriptionalists claim that underlying the experience of mental imagery is some sort of representation that is descriptional or linguistic in nature. By distinguishing between experiences and the underlying representations, we undercut the force of the introspective judgment that lies at the heart of the argument from introspection, namely, that mental images look like what they represent.

Pictorialists and descriptionalists alike thus accept that we sometimes think in images. In other words, pictorialists and descriptionalists agree that we have certain imagistic experiences, that we experience what we would call “imaging.” When we introspect, when we look within, it seems to us as if we are experiencing mental pictures. But the experience is one thing, the representation that accounts for this experience another. The pictorialists think that the introspective data should be interpreted just as it seems—our mind manipulates representations that are pictorial in nature. The pictorialist view thus offers us a unified conception of our experiences and the representations that underlie them. In contrast, the descriptionalists think that the introspective data is misleading in a certain sense; our experiences are not quite as they seem. Insofar as it seems to us that we have certain mental representations that are pictorial in nature, we are the victims of an illusion.

In defending descriptionalism against the argument from introspection, Tye (1991) makes the further point that all that introspection really suggests is that imaging is like perception: “to assert that a mental image of my brother, say, looks to me like my brother is merely to assert that my imagistic experience is like the perceptual experience I undergo when I view my brother with my eyes.” Empirical experiments have tended to confirm introspective reports that imaging resembles perceiving. Perky (1910) placed a number of people in a room, facing a screen, and asked them to produce mental images of various ordinary objects on the screen. The subjects were not aware of the fact that, after they had reported that they were engaged in the requested imaging (of a banana, for example), an image of a banana was lightly projected onto the screen. The projected image was slowly increased in intensity until, eventually, it was visible to any newcomer entering the room. Nonetheless, the subjects never realized that they were seeing an image of a banana. The only differences that they noted in their subjective experiences were changes in the size and the orientation of the banana they had been imaging. In this highly controlled setting at least, seeing was mistaken for visual imaging.

Additional empirical evidence strongly suggests that the mechanisms underlying imagery and underlying perception are the same. (For an overview of some such experiments, see Finke and Shepard 1986.) One set of important results was generated by Kosslyn (1993), who demonstrated using positron emission tomography (PET) that areas of the brain activated when we engage in object recognition are also activated when we produce visual mental imagery. Other important results come from studies on patients who have suffered damage to parts of their visual system. Bisiach and Luzzatti (1978) studied patients who suffer from hemi-neglect, i.e., patients who ignore objects in one half of their visual field. These patients were discovered also to neglect objects in the same half when producing mental images. To give another example, prosopagnosiacs, who cannot recognize faces, have been shown to suffer from similar difficulties when interpreting mental imagery (Levine, Warach, and Farah 1985).

Given the totality of the evidence, both introspective and empirical, it seems reasonable to assume that the representations underlying the experience of imagery are like the representations that underlie the experience of perception. Importantly, however, the representations that underlie the experience of perception may themselves be descriptional in nature. Thus, without a theory of the nature of the representation underlying perceptual experience, evidence connecting mental imagery with perception cannot be taken as support for pictorialism.

c. Objections to Pictorialism

While the above considerations suggest that the argument from introspection should be rejected, they do not entail the truth of descriptionalism. So why would anyone embrace descriptionalism? One influential consideration, as noted earlier, comes from the seeming incompatibility of pictorialism and materialism. This problem, at least in part, is what Block (1983) has called the No Seeum Objection: when we look in the brain, we do not see any pictures.

Of course, when we look in the brain, we do not see any descriptions either. But, in contrast to the pictorialists, the descriptionalists seem to have an easy response to the No Seeum charge. Sterelny (1986) notes that, since sentences are not medium-dependent, accounting for descriptional representations in the brain is unproblematic: “Sentences can come as sound waves, marks on paper, electrical pulses, punched cards, and so on. Why not then as patterns of neural firings as well?”

Interestingly, Block (1983) argues that we can extend this sort of response to protect pictorialism from the No Seeum objection as well. To know whether you are looking at a descriptional representation, you must be familiar with the representational medium that is in use. Block proposes that the pictorialist can adopt this same line of reasoning. What makes something the sort of representation that it is, regardless of whether it is pictorial or descriptional, depends in large part on the system of representation in which it functions. Thus, until we know more about how the representational system of the brain works, we are unlikely even to be able to tell which structures in the brain are representations, let alone what sort of representations they are.

Descriptionalism has also been thought to gain support from the Paraphernalia Objection to pictorialism: even if we were to discover pictures in the brain, these pictures could not play a role in our cognitive processes unless there were an internal eye to see the pictures, and since there is no such internal eye, pictorialism must be false. (See Rey 1981, Block 1983 for discussion of this objection.) Dennett (1969) voices the Paraphernalia objection by way of an apt analogy:

Imagine a fool putting a television camera on his car and connecting it to a small receiver under the bonnet so the engine could ‘see where it is going’. The madness in this is that although an image has been provided, no provision has been made for anyone or anything analogous to a perceiver to watch the image.

According to the Paraphernalia objection, the pictorialist is like this fool. Block (1983) and Kosslyn (1980) each suggest responses that the pictorialist can make to this objection; in short, the basic strategy is to invoke mechanistic explanation.

Finally, Dennett (1969) presents two examples that seem to cause trouble for pictorialism and provide support for descriptionalism. The first example involves a striped tiger. (See also Armstrong 1968 for a related example involving a speckled hen.) Form a mental image of a tiger and then try to answer the following question: How many stripes does that tiger have? Invariably, the question cannot be answered; the mental images that we form typically do not contain that information. However, just as all tigers have a definite number of stripes, so too do all pictures of tigers. Thus, if mental images were pictorial, a mental image of a tiger should reveal a definite number of stripes. More formally, the objection to pictorialism that the striped tiger example poses can be stated as follows:

  1. Mental images can be indeterminate with respect to visual properties (e.g., the number of stripes on a tiger).
  2. Pictorial representations cannot be indeterminate with respect to visual properties.
  3. So, mental images are not pictorial representations.

Dennett’s second example attempts to show that mental images can be noncommittal in a way in which pictorial representations generally cannot. (See also Shorter 1952. In what follows, I slightly modify Dennett’s example. See Block 1981a for a discussion of why the example needs modification.) Form a mental image of a tall woman wearing a hat and then try to answer the following questions: What kind of hat was it? Was she sitting or standing? Was she indoors or outdoors? Was she wearing shoes? Was she wearing a watch? Though you can undoubtedly answer some of these questions—probably you can tell what kind of hat the woman was wearing in your image, be it a beret or a cowboy hat or a baseball cap—you were probably unable to answer some of the others. When asked whether she was indoors or outdoors, or whether she was wearing a watch, you probably did not have enough information to answer the question. And this need not be because you imagined her only from the neck up. Even if you imagined her full-figure before you, your image likely did not go into sufficient detail to enable you to answer whether she was wearing a watch.

Consider next a picture of a tall woman wearing a hat. Dennett argues that in a pictorial representation of the woman, assuming that her wrists are in view, she must either be depicted wearing a watch or not wearing a watch. The only way for the picture to avoid addressing the issue would be to have something obscuring the woman’s wrists. This seems to differentiate the representational nature of a mental image from the representational nature of a picture. Your image can be inexplicitly noncommittal about whether she is wearing a watch, but a picture can only be explicitly noncommittal about it. (This terminology derives from Block 1981a.)

Finally, consider a written description of the woman. Clearly a description can be inexplicitly noncommittal. Your description might be very short, for example, which would make it impossible to tell whether the woman was wearing a watch or not. Dennett thus concludes that mental imagery has to be descriptional, and not pictorial, in nature.

In response to this example, Block (1981a), Fodor (1975), and Tye (1991) have each argued that Dennett is operating with too narrow a conception of pictorial representation, accusing him of committing the photographic fallacy. If we consider photographs, which are one kind of pictorial representation, then it might seem that Dennett is right: photographs are incapable of being inexplicitly noncommittal about visual features. But consideration of photographs does not show that pictorial representation in general lacks this option. In particular, consider children’s drawings or stick figures. In drawing a stick figure of a woman, you might simply fail to go into the matter of the woman’s wristwear. There are lots of different kinds of pictorial representation, and although both stick figure drawings and photographs represent pictorially, they do so in very different ways. The pictorialists’ claim that mental images represent pictorially should not force one to the position that mental images are like mental snapshots; they might be more like mental stick-figure drawings.

Interestingly, these points about the photographic fallacy do not protect the pictorialist from the striped tiger example. Since there is a difference between being inexplicitly noncommittal and being indeterminate, the fact that some pictorial representations, like stick figures, are able to be inexplicitly noncommittal about certain visual features does not show that they can be indeterminate about these visual features. The descriptionalist might argue that just as a photograph has to depict a determinate number of stripes on the tiger, so too does a stick-figure drawing.

Fodor (1975) suggests a way to deny the first premise of the above argument. It might be that there is some definite answer to the question, “how many stripes does my image-tiger have?” but that I cannot answer the question because images are labile (changing constantly, plastic); the problem is that we cannot hold onto our images long enough to count the stripes. Ultimately, however, Fodor rejects the second premise of the above argument, suggesting that on blurry or out-of-focus pictures there may not be a determinate answer to the question, “How many stripes are there on the photograph?” (See Hannay 1971 for a similar treatment of the problem.)

Alternatively, the pictorialist might reject the move that Dennett seems to make from the claim:

(a) I cannot count the stripes on the tiger in my mental image

to the claim:

(b)The mental image is indeterminate with respect to the number of stripes.

Your mental image might well be determinate without your being able to count the stripes. For example, if you only get a fleeting glance at an actual tiger, you are not going to be able to count his stripes. (See Lyons 1984 for a suggestion of this sort.) But that does not entail that the tiger has an indeterminate number of stripes.

d. A Remaining Question About Pictorial vs. Descriptional Representation

Above, in explaining the descriptionalist view, I noted that descriptional representations need not be literally descriptive. Descriptional representations are characterized primarily negatively, i.e., for the purposes of understanding the imagery debate, a representation will count as descriptional as long as it is not pictorial. This assumes, however, that we have a clear understanding of what makes a representation pictorial. Unfortunately, spelling out exactly what makes a representation a pictorial one—or, to put it another way, spelling out the nature of depiction—turns out to be rather difficult.

It is standardly noted that a pictorial representation must have at least one feature in common with what it is representing. Not just any feature will do, so we will have to limit ourselves to visual features. Suppose that we could specify, without begging any questions, what a visual feature is. In any case, we can surely identify some uncontroversial examples of visual features, such as color and shape, even if we cannot give a precise specification of what makes something a visual feature. Nonetheless, it soon becomes apparent that merely sharing the visual feature of color with the thing represented seems insufficient to make a representation pictorial. To take an obvious example, writing the noun “apple” in red ink does not make it a pictorial representation of an apple. (See Rey 1981 and Hopkins 1995 for further discussion of the nature of depiction.)

In the absence of a clear characterization of pictorial representation, some recent accounts of mental images may seem difficult to classify as either pictorialist or descriptionalist. For example, Tye (1991) claims that his own view of mental imagery—which treats images as interpreted, symbol-filled arrays—is a “hybrid” one. Since these arrays are in some respects like pictures but in other respects like linguistic representations, Tye claims that his view cannot be easily classified as either pictorialist or descriptionalist.

2. Accounts of Imagination

Mental imagery clearly plays a role in many mental activities. For example, memory often proceeds by way of imagery. But no mental activity is more prominently linked with mental imagery than that of imagining. In this section, I will discuss different accounts of the imagination, paying particular attention to the connections between imagery and imagination.

a. Image-Based Theories

René Descartes’ treatment of the imagination (1642/1984) is representative of a long philosophical tradition that analyzes imagination in terms of mental imagery. As he says in his Meditations on First Philosophy:

[I]f I want to think of a chiliagon, although I understand that it is a figure consisting of a thousand sides just as well as I understand the triangle to be a three-sided figure, I do not in the same way imagine the thousand sides or see them as if they were present before me. … But suppose I am dealing with a pentagon: I can of course understand the figure of a pentagon, just as I can the figure of a chiliagon, without the help of the imagination; but I can also imagine a pentagon, by applying the mind’s eye to its five sides and the area contained within them. And in doing this I notice quite clearly that imagination requires a peculiar effort of mind which is not required for understanding.

Presumably, what he means by this “peculiar effort of mind” is the effort to produce an image. In this way, Descartes sharply distinguishes the act of imagining from the related intellectual act of conceiving (or, in his terms, the act of understanding).

On this understanding of the imagination, imagining is thought of as importantly analogous to perception. This fits well with various experimental data (notably, Perky 1910) and corresponds to a long philosophical tradition of treating imagining as an inferior kind of perceiving. For example, Thomas Hobbes (1651/1968) refers to imagining as “decaying sense” and George Berkeley (1734/1965) claims that sense perceptions are “more strong, lively, and distinct” than our imaginings.

This analogy between imagining and perceiving makes it natural to consider imagination as a kind of perception with the “mind’s eye.” Again, Descartes’ discussion of the imagination in the Sixth Meditation provides a representative example of this:

When I imagine a triangle, for example, I do not merely understand that it is a figure bounded by three lines, but at the same time I also see the three lines with my mind’s eye as if they were present before me; and this is what I call imagining. (1642/1984)

Of course, there are clear instances of imagining in which the mind’s “eye” is not doing any work at all, i.e., in which visual images are not involved. Vendler (1984) gives examples such as imagining the roar of the lion, imagining the smell of onions frying on a grill, imagining the heat of the sun, imagining the pain in one’s molar. The image-based account thus must extend the notion of image to encompass imagistic representations from other sensory modalities. Presumably, there are counterparts to visual images for each of the other senses—auditory images, olfactory images, and so on. The case of imagining the pain in one’s molar can be dealt with in a parallel way. Although pain is not perceived by one of the five traditional senses, there is an analogue to sensory images that comes into play in this case: what is often called an affective image.

Even with this broad understanding of the notion of image, however, there are instances of uses of the word “imagine” in everyday language that do not seem to involve mental imagery. Consider cases where “imagine” is used to signal supposition (or, even more commonly, false supposition), as when a parent who says, “I imagined that my daughter was in her room last night, when in fact I now learn that she snuck out her bedroom window.” Consider also cases where “imagine” is used as part of various idiomatic expressions, as when someone says, “Imagine that!” in response to some surprising news.

Fortunately for the proponent of an image-based account, such cases can be easily dismissed. Surely it is unreasonable to expect that we should have to accommodate every ordinary language use of “imagine” or its cognates when giving an account of the imagination. (But see White 1990 for a contrary view.) Rather, what we should focus on are the cases where the imagination is actually being exercised and attempt to explain the nature of such imaginative exercises. This is what the proponent of the image-based account attempts to do.

So let us focus on actual exercises of the imagination. Are there any such exercises in which there is no mental imagery? Ryle (1949) answers in the affirmative. Though he grants that acts commonly described as “having a mental picture” of something are instances of imagining, he argues that concentrating on these sorts of examples to the exclusion of others gives us a misleading picture of what the imagination is. Consider:

  1. a witness who lies when she takes the stand
  2. an inventor who contemplates the machine she is working on
  3. a novelist working out the plot of her next book
  4. a group of children who are pretending that they are bears.

In these cases, Ryle claims that the witness, the inventor, the novelist, and the children may be exercising their imaginations without accompanying imagery. (In fact, the exercises of the imagination that occur when the judge listens to the lying witness’ story, the inventor’s colleague comments on the new machine, someone reads the novel, and the mother ignores the growls emanating from the “bears,” also might well proceed without imagery.) Think about what is going on when a group of children “play bears.” They get down on their hands and knees, growl at each other, probably rearrange the sofa cushions to make dens for themselves, and so on—but while engaging in this activity, they need not produce mental imagery of, say, furry paws and the snowbound den.

In response to Ryle’s discussion, the proponent of an image-based conception of the imagination might argue that these cases conflate being imaginative with exercising the imagination. But even if this suggestion covers the above cases, there are additional examples for which the suggestion lacks plausibility. White (1990) suggests that “we can imagine, or be unable to imagine, what the neighbours will think or why someone should try to kill us, just as we can imagine that the neighbours envy us or that someone is trying to kill us. Yet none of these imagined situations is something picturable in visual, auditory or tangible terms and, therefore, none is something pertaining to imagery.” Likewise, although we can imagine George W. Bush playing the electric guitar, how (assuming that imagining requires imagery) can we imagine his having a secret desire to be a rock and roll musician? What image could we produce to imagine, as John Lennon exhorts us to do, that there’s no heaven?

In addition to dealing with counterexamples such as these, there are two questions that any proponent of an image-based account must answer:

(1)What role does the image play in imagining?

(2)What makes an imagining the imagining that it is?

Image-based theories have often been saddled with an unfortunate answer to the first of these questions. First, once someone invokes mental images in an account of imagination, she appears to commit herself to the claim that such images are the objects of our imaginings—a highly implausible claim. (For development of this argument, see Vendler 1984.) In brief, the problem with this view is that when I imagine something, say George W. Bush, my imagining is about George W. Bush, not about a mental image. The proponent of an image-based account thus must find some other way of answering question (1).

Interestingly, image-based theories have also often been saddled with an unfortunate answer to the second question, namely, that the image involved in an imagining serves to individuate the imagining from other imaginings. The problem, however, is that imagery seems neither necessary nor sufficient to make an imagining the imagining it is. The basic worry traces back to Wittgenstein (1953), who wrote, “What makes my image of him into an image of him? Not its looking like him.” (See also Tidman 1994.) Consider the following two examples from White (1990):

One is imagining exactly the same thing when one imagines that, for example, a sailor is scrambling ashore on a desert island, however varied one’s imagery may be.

The imagery of a sailor scrambling ashore could be exactly the same as that of his twin brother crawling backwards into the sea, yet to imagine one of these is quite different from imagining the other.

Although proponents of image-based theories have various options for answering both of these questions (see Kind 2001), the associated problems have often led to the abandonment of image-based accounts.

b. Non-Image-Based Theories

In response to the apparent problems besetting image-based accounts (particularly the apparent counterexamples discussed above), many theorists deemphasize the role and importance of mental imagery in imagination. While accepting that some exercises of the imagination involve imagery, they deny that the imagery plays any sort of essential role in making a mental act an act of the imagination; moreover, they also claim that there are other instances of imagining that do not involve imagery. Scruton (1974) and Walton (1990) both offer theories of this sort. Scruton claims that “imagining may, and often does, involve imagery” but that “neither [imagination nor imagery] is a necessary feature of the other.” Walton accepts that some exercises of the imagination “consist partly in having mental images,” but claims also that “imagining can occur without imagery.” Hidé Ishiguru (1966) deemphasizes the image even further. On Ishiguru’s view, imagery never plays an essential role in imagining: “mental images are, at most, necessary tools for a limited number of people in certain kinds of exercise of the imagination and are, for many people, merely psychological accompaniments which occur when they are engaged in imaginative work and not the essence of it.” Finally, another non-image-based account is offered by White (1990), who claims that to imagine a state of affairs is to think of it as possibly being so.

Perhaps the most important variety of non-image-based account, however, is the experiential theory. Lyons (1986), Peacocke (1985), and Vendler (1984) each offer a version of this theory. While there are significant differences between these three philosophers’ versions of the experiential theory, there are nonetheless important similarities, and I will here concentrate on Vendler’s version as representative of the tradition that analyzes imagining in terms of experience.

Vendler explicitly treats imagination as a kind of vicarious experience, claiming that “the materia ex qua of all imagination is imagined experience.” To motivate this account, Vendler contrasts two different kinds of imaginative exercises. First, imagine swimming in cold water. Next, imagine yourself swimming in cold water. In the first case, what you do is to imagine the salty taste of the water, the feel of the waves as they lap against you, and so on. You put yourself in the water from the inside. Vendler calls this subjective imagining. In the second case, one thing you might do is to picture yourself in the water, so you see your head bobbing in the waves, and so on. Once again, you put yourself in the water, but in this case you do it from the outside. Vendler calls this objective imagining.

Notice that I can adopt the same objective perspective in imagining someone else. I can just as easily imagine my sister or my husband swimming in the ocean as I can imagine myself swimming in the ocean. But subjective imagining works differently. There, I conjure up the experiences that I would be having if I were in certain circumstances, and it seems that I can do this only about myself. In objective imagining, I imagine what someone, myself included, would look like in a certain situation; in subjective imagining, I imagine what the situation itself would feel like.

Clearly, subjective imagining involves evoking experiences. When I imagine swimming in the ocean, I evoke experiences like feeling cold, being pulled by the current, and seeing the shoreline. Interestingly, however, Vendler argues that objective imagining also requires us to evoke experiences. When I imagine myself swimming in the water, I am essentially imagining the experience of seeing (or hearing, etc.) myself swimming in the water. Thus, objective imagination ultimately reduces to a specialized kind of subjective imagination. According to Vendler, the materials of both subjective and objective imagination are basically the same, namely, experiences. Both kinds of imagination are constructions out of experiences, but the constructions proceed in slightly different ways: “In the subjective case the aim is to represent a consciousness, one’s own, or someone else’s, at a given point of life-history. In the objective case the purpose is to represent a thing as it appears in the field of experience” (Vendler 1984).

Adopting an experiential account has interesting consequences for answering the question: What can we imagine? The basic form of subjective imagining is “I imagine φ-ing,” suggesting that we can substitute any activity for φ. But Vendler does not believe that we can. Consider being dead, or being sound asleep, or snoring while sound asleep. These are activities, or states of being, that lack experiential content. According to an experiential account of imagining, it is a necessary condition on imagining performing a certain action φ (or imagining being in a certain condition C) that there be an experiential content to φ-ing (or to being C). Thus these are activities that Vendler does not think we can imagine.

An interesting corollary of this necessary condition comes out in Thomas Nagel’s seminal paper, “What is it like to be a bat?” (1974). Bats are mammals, and most of us would probably share the intuition that they have conscious experiences, but bats perceive the external world in a way that is radically different from the way we perceive the external world: they use sonar, or echolocation. They emit high-pitched, subtly modulated noises and then detect objects that are in range on the basis of the reflections they detect. This raises an interesting question: can we know what it is like to be a bat? In attempting to answer this question, Nagel implicitly endorses the claim of an experiential account that we can only imagine what we can experience; as he notes, “Our own experience provides the basic material for our imagination, whose range is therefore limited.” Because Nagel thinks our imagination does not allow us to extrapolate to the experience of bats, he denies that we can imagine what it is like to be a bat. This shows that on an experiential account, not only must there be an experiential content to φ-ing (or to being C), but also it must be the case that the experiential content is in principle accessible to the imaginer.

Although the experiential account has some intuitive plausibility, the reduction of objective imagination to subjective imagination requires the proponent of the experiential analysis to do some fancy footwork in response to certain occurrences of the word “imagine” that come up in everyday speech. For example, it is quite common to say things like:

  • “Imagine that there is life on Mars.”
  • “I can pretty clearly imagine why she married him.”
  • “Imagine what would happen if the NAFTA treaty had not been signed.”

In each case, it seems as if we change the meaning of each of these mental exercises if we insert the word “seeing.” Imagining that there is life on Mars might not entail putting myself into the situation as observer, that is, it seems that it need not involve imagining seeing that there is life on Mars. Similar points can be made about the other two cases.

To deal with this problem, Vendler argues that the word “imagine” functions differently in these cases from the way it functions in the cases of objective and subjective imagination that we’ve been talking about. In essence, Vendler denies that these claims describe genuine exercises of the imagination. Just as one might say “I can pretty well see why she married him” without implying that one was doing something with one’s eyes, one can say “I can pretty well imagine why she married him” without implying that one is doing something with one’s imagination. In this case, it seems plausible to suppose that what is going on is an exercise of reasoning rather than a perceptual or imaginative exercise. (This recalls the strategy used by the image-based theorists to dismiss cases in which the word “imagining” seems to mean only supposition.)

There are, however, other cases that Vendler may not be able to dismiss as easily. Some of these are the sorts of cases that threaten image-based accounts—both image-based theories and experiential theories have trouble accounting for apparently non-perceptual imagining, as when someone imagines a solution to a problem. White (1990) suggests other examples as well; for example, one can imagine “sacrificing everything for one’s principles or selling one’s birthright for a mess of pottage, without giving oneself a representation of any experiences.” Or, to use another of White’s examples, suppose someone imagines giving up all she has for love. It is hard for the experiential theorist to dismiss this as an exercise of mere reasoning, but likewise, it is not plausible to suggest that in such an imagining what one is doing is imagining seeing oneself giving up all one has for love.

Interestingly, the fact that examples of the sort that threatened image-based accounts reappear in the context of experiential accounts suggests an important connection between these two types of accounts. Though image-based accounts and experiential accounts initially appear clearly different, in that they draw attention to different features that make an act an act of the imagination, it can be argued that the experiential analysis entails that acts of the imagination will involve mental imagery. If such an argument were to succeed, then the experiential account would ultimately collapse into an image-based account. Recall that Vendler claims that the material of the imagination is imagined experience. The image-based theorist might try to argue that these experiences can only be understood in terms of imagery. Similar points might be made about other experiential theories. For example, Lyons (1986) offers an experiential analysis according to which imagination is the “replay” of perception. For Lyons, when someone imagines something, she does not form a mental image but rather rehearses, reactivates, or replays the act of seeing that thing. But since, as we saw above, empirical evidence strongly suggests that the mechanisms underlying imagery and underlying perception are the same, the replay of perception will likely involve imagery as well.

As the foregoing suggests, even if experiential theories do not analyze imagination in terms of imagery, such theories may be thought at least implicitly to rely on imagery. Thus, insofar as mental imagery is ontologically problematic, such problems will likely confront experiential theories as well as image-based theories. Ontological worries about imagery began with the rise of behaviorism in the early twentieth century. As the mind-brain identity theory gained currency in the 1950s, worries about imagery grew, since the very existence of mental images has been thought to raise an ontological problem for such theories. To put the problem crudely, images are not the right sort of “stuff” for use in a scientific explanation of the mind. This problem has engendered a strong antipathy for mental images in the second half of the twentieth century. Correspondingly, many of the mid- to late-twentieth century theories of imagination, such as those offered by Ryle (1949), Shorter (1952), Armstrong (1968), and Dennett (1969), are imageless theories.

Ryle’s theory, which is probably the most developed of the imageless theories, was constructed in direct reaction to the Cartesian view of imagining. Ryle worries that once we think of imagining as a sort of seeing with the mind’s eye, we are inclined to suppose that there exist things, mental images, that are seen with the mind’s eye. His goal is to prevent this natural move: “the familiar truth that people are constantly seeing things in their minds’ eyes and hearing things in their heads is no proof that there exist things which they see and hear….” His defense of this claim relies in large part on an analogy: Just as the fact that a murder is staged as part of a play does not entail that there is a victim actually murdered, the fact that we see things with the mind’s eye does not entail that there are things actually seen. This analogy also leads Ryle to a positive theory of the imagination. Since an actor’s resemblance to a murderer can be explained by the fact that he is pretending to be a murderer, and pretending to murder, we can also explain the similarity between the imaginer and the observer by invoking the notion of pretense. More generally, Ryle claims that imagining is a species of pretending.

Ryle is clearly right that there are similarities between imagining and pretending; in particular, there is what we might call an “air of hypotheticality” to both activities. But despite such similarities, it seems a mistake to characterize the former sort of activity in terms of the latter. As Ryle characterizes it, pretending is typically a performance intended to convince, while imagining is the sort of pretending that typically aims at convincing oneself rather than others. But many cases of imagining involve no attempt at persuasion—even of oneself. Consider various different kinds of imagining: imagining one’s next dentist appointment, imagining the pain of having a tooth pulled, or imagining the tooth itself. In none of these imaginings must we suppose that the imaginer tries to convince herself of anything. White (1990) criticizes Ryle’s analogy between pretending and imagining in detail, elaborating numerous differences between these two types of activities. (See also Hamlyn 1994.)

Kind (2001), in addition to providing further criticism of Ryle’s account, argues more generally that any theory of imageless imagining is likely to be unsatisfactory. The argument rests on the inability of imageless theories to account sufficiently for three features of imagining: its directedness, its active nature, and its phenomenology. A theory which assimilates imagining to pretending, as Ryle’s did, can account for the active nature of imagining, and perhaps for its directedness, but not for its distinctive phenomenology. Another option available to the imageless theorist, such assimilating imagining to belief, will account for its directedness, but not for its active nature or its phenomenology. Likewise, if the imageless theorist were to assimilate imagining to sensation, he could account for its phenomenology, and perhaps for its directedness, but not for its active nature. Though Kind admits that there may be other options available to the imageless theorist, she takes her reflection on the above examples to suggest the basic difficulty that any imageless theory confronts: It seems that an adequate account of imagination must invoke some sort of mental representation in order to account for the directedness and active nature of imagining, but non-imagistic mental representations seem unable to account for imagining’s phenomenology. The invocation of imagery seems to be the only way to account for the three features of imagining in conjunction.

3. Imagination and Possibility

Now that we have reflected on the nature of the imagination, in this last section let us consider briefly the role that imagination plays in modal epistemology. Like David Hume (1739/1969), who wrote in the Treatise that “nothing we imagine is absolutely impossible,” contemporary philosophers have often associated the imaginable with the possible. Moreover, it is commonly supposed that the faculty of the imagination is an important tool in our acquisition of modal knowledge; the imagination, it is thought, serves as an epistemological guide to possibility.

Strictly speaking, the above quotation from Hume draws a connection between what we (in fact) imagine and what is possible, but philosophers have generally drawn the evidential link between what is imaginable and what is possible. Conversely, there has also been thought to be an evidential link between what is unimaginable and what is impossible; Hume claimed, for example, that our inability to imagine a mountain without a valley leads us to regard a valley-less mountain as impossible. The traditional conception of the link between imagination and possibility thus comprises the following two claims:

Unimaginability claim: if something is unimaginable, then it is impossible.

Imaginability claim: if something is imaginable, then it is possible.

Though these claims did not originate with Hume—Descartes (1642/1984), for example, famously relied on the imaginability claim in his argument for dualism, drawing the conclusion that disembodiment is possible from the premise that disembodiment is imaginable—he is the philosopher with whom they are most commonly associated. Thus, I will refer to them jointly as the Humean thesis.

Many different notions of possibility abound in contemporary philosophical discussion, so we should be clear that the possibility invoked by the Humean thesis is usually meant to be a very weak one, namely, logical possibility. Importantly, logical possibility far outstrips physical possibility; what is physically possible is governed by the laws of physics, but what is logically possible is governed only by the laws of logic. Were the imagination meant to be a guide to the physically possible, the imaginability claim would be immediately problematic. Many physical impossibilities seem easily imaginable: I might imagine a juggling pin remaining suspended in the air after having been thrown there, or I might imagine the eight ball remaining absolutely motionless after I hit it with the cue ball.

Ultimately, it seems that an analogy to perception motivates the Humean thesis: imagination is supposed to give rise to knowledge of possibility as perception gives rise to knowledge of the actual world. Our knowledge of the world in which we live is grounded largely in perception. But, since we have no sensory access to what is not actually the case, perception can afford us no real insight into non-actualized possibilities. In contrast, the imagination is not limited to what is actually the case. This feature of the imagination, in conjunction with the close connection between perception and imagination, is what seems to lead us to rely on the imagination for knowledge of possibility.

In fact, we need only to reflect briefly on how we typically form modal judgments to see the force of the Humean thesis. Presumably, we are convinced that it is possible for there to be purple cows, and for humans to fly unaided by machines, as a result of our imaginings: we can imagine a purple cow, and we can imagine humans flying without mechanical aid. Likewise, consider how we would determine whether round squares are possible, or whether it would have been possible for me to have been a fish. Our conviction that these are impossible states of affairs springs from our inability to imagine them. As Hart (1988) writes, “One’s own experience in settling modal questions seems to show that the imagination plays a fundamental role.”

But despite this intuitive support for the Humean thesis, there is legitimate reason to worry about it. The unimaginability claim in particular has been thought to be especially problematic. One problem derives from the fact that there is considerable variation among individuals’ imaginative capacities. Jill might be able to imagine many things that Jack cannot, in which case it would seem clear that we are by no means entitled to infer from the fact that Jack cannot imagine something that it is impossible. Fortunately, this problem can be fairly easily resolved by interpreting “unimaginable” as something like “unimaginable by any human.” Another problem is the fact that there might be features of human psychology that make certain states of affairs in principle unimaginable by any of us. But if the unimaginability of a state of affairs is due solely to some psychological limitation on our part, then we would not seem to be justified in inferring the impossibility of such a state. (See White 1990; Tidman 1994.)

Most problematic, however, is that the limitation of the possible to the imaginable, particularly on an image-based analysis of imagination, seems overly restrictive. Insofar as the imagination cannot extend to non-sensory objects and states of affairs, philosophers claim that we should not draw conclusions about impossibility based on unimaginability. For this reason, the Humean thesis is often interpreted as about conceivability rather than imaginability, where conception is supposed to be an intellectual faculty. (See Yablo 1993; Tidman 1994. But see Hart 1988 and Kind 2002 for arguments against this interpretation of the Humean thesis.)

The imaginability claim is generally thought to be less problematic than the unimaginability claim, and as such it (and/or the parallel conceivability claim) is often used in philosophical arguments. Modern-day philosophers of mind, in the tradition of the Cartesian argument mentioned above, argue that certain of our imaginings condemn type materialism. Type materialism is committed to the claim that pain, for example, is necessarily identical to a certain brain state, call it “S”. Insofar as we can imagine creatures who are in pain despite lacking biological brains (and thus S-states) altogether, it seems that it is possible for pain to be distinct from S-states. Related imaginings are brought to bear against functionalist theories of mind. To defend their theories, materialists and functionalists either argue directly against the imaginability claim, suggesting that imagining is not a reliable guide to possibility, or argue that in the imaginings in question we have not imagined what we think we have (Tye 1995). This latter point has led to a general cautionary tone in recent discussions of the connection between imagination and possibility, with many philosophers greatly restricting both the kind of imagining that can serve as an epistemic guide to modality and the kind of possibility to which imagining can serve as a guide (see Chalmers 2002 and Yablo 1993).

4. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. 1968. A Materialist Theory of the Mind. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Berkeley, G. 1734/1965. “A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge” and “Three Dialogues Between Hylas and Philonous.” In George Berkeley: Principles, Dialogues, and Philosophical Correspondence, edited with an introduction by C.M. Turbayne. Indianapolis: Bobbs-Merrill Educational Publishing.
  • Bisiach, E., and Luzzatti, C. 1978. “Unilateral Neglect of Representational Space.” Cortex 14: 129-33.
  • Block, N. 1981. Imagery. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Block, N. 1981a. “What Is the Issue?” In Block 1981.
  • Block, N. 1981b. Readings in the Philosophy of Psychology, vol. 2. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Block, N. 1983. “Mental Pictures and Cognitive Science.” In Lycan 1990. Casey, E. 1971. “Imagination: Imagining and the Image.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 31: 475-90.
  • Chalmers, D. 2002. “Does Conceivability Entail Possibility?” Imagination, Conceivability, and Possibility, edited by T. Gendler and J. Hawthorne. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Currie, G. 1995. “Visual Imagery as the Simulation of Vision.” Mind and Language 10: 25-44.
  • Dennett, D. 1969. “The Nature of Images and the Introspective Trap.” In Block 1981.
  • Dennett, D. 1979. “Two Approaches to Mental Images.” In Block 1981.
  • Descartes, R. 1642/1984. “Meditations on First Philosophy.” In The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, vol. 2, edited by J. Cottingham et al. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Finke, R.A., and Shepard, R.N. 1986. “Visual Function of Mental Imagery.” In Handbook of Perception and Human Performance, edited by K.R. Boff, L. Kaufman, and J.P. Thomas. Chichester: John Wiley & Sons (1986).
  • Flew, A. 1953. “Images, Supposing, and Imagining.” Philosophy 28: 246-254.
  • Fodor, J. 1975. “Imagistic Representation.” In Block 1981.
  • Hamlyn, D.W. 1994. “Imagination.” In A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind, edited by Samuel Guttenplan. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers (1994): 361-66.
  • Hannay, A. 1971. Mental Images: A Defence. London: George Allen and Urwin, Ltd.
  • Hart, W.D. 1988. The Engines of the Soul. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Heil, J. 1998. Philosophy of Mind. New York: Routledge.
  • Hobbes, T. 1651/1968. Leviathan. London: Penguin Books.
  • Hopkins, R. 1995. “Explaining Depiction.” Philosophical Review 104: 425-55.
  • Hume, D. 1739/1969. A Treatise of Human Nature. Edited by E.C. Mossner. London: Penguin Books.
  • Ishiguro, H. 1967. “Imagination.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary 41: 37-56.
  • Kind, A. 2001. “Putting the Image Back in Imagination,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 62: 85-109.
  • Kind, A. 2002 (unpublished). “Imagination and Possibility.”
  • Kosslyn, S.M. 1973. “Scanning Visual Images: Some Structural Implications.” Perception and Psychophysics 14: 90-94.
  • Kosslyn, S.M., and Pomerantz, J.R. 1977. “Imagery, Propositions, and the Form of Internal Representations.” Cognitive Psychology 9: 52-76.
  • Kosslyn, S.M. 1980. Image and Mind. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Kosslyn, S.M. 1993. Image and Brain: The Resolution of the Imagery Debate. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • Kosslyn, S.M., and Osherson, D.N. 1995. Visual Cognition, An Invitation to Cognitive Science, vol. 2. Cambridge, Mass.: The MIT Press.
  • Levine, D., Warach, J., and Farah, M. 1985. “Two Visual Systems in Mental Imagery.” Neurology 35: 1011-18.
  • Lycan, W.G. 1990. Mind and Cognition. Cambridge, Mass.: Basil Blackwell.
  • Lyons, W. 1984. “The Tiger and His Stripes.” Analysis 44: 93-93.
  • Lyons, W. 1986. “‘Introspection’ as the Replay of Perception.” The Disappearance of Introspection. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press/Bradford Books.
  • Nagel, T. 1974. “What Is It Like To Be a Bat?” Philosophical Review 83 (4): 435-50.
  • Peacocke, C. 1985. “Imagination, Experience and Possibility: a Berkeleian View Defended.” In Essays on Berkeley, edited by J. Foster and H. Robinson. Oxford: Clarendon Press (1985): 19-35.
  • Perky, C.W. 1910. “An Experimental Study of Imagination.” American Journal of Psychology 21: 422-52.
  • Russow, L.M. 1978. “Some Recent Work on Imagination.” American Philosophical Quarterly 15 (1): 57-66.
  • Pinker, S. 1997. How the Mind Works. New York: Norton.
  • Pylyshyn, Z. 1973. “What the Mind’s Eye Tells the Mind’s Brain—A Critique of Mental Imagery.” Psychological Bulletin 80:1-24.
  • Pylyshyn, Z. 1978. “Imagery and Artificial Intelligence.” In Perception and Cognition: Issues in the Foundation of Psychology, edited by C. Wade Savage. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press (1978): 19-56.
  • Reynolds, S.L. 1989. “Imagining Oneself To Be Another.” Nous 23: 615-33.
  • Ryle, G. 1949. “Imagination.” The Concept of Mind. London: Hutchison & Company.
  • Schwitzgebel, E. 2002. “How Well Do We Know Our Own Conscious Experience? The Case of Imagery.” Journal of Consciousness Studies 9: 35-53.
  • Scruton, R. 1982. Art and Imagination. London: Routledge.
  • Seddon, G. 1972. “Logical Possibility.” Mind 81: 481-94.
  • Shepard, R. N., and Metzler, J. 1971. “Mental Rotation of Three-Dimensional Objects.” Science 171: 701-03.
  • Shepard, R.N., and Cooper, L. 1982. Mental Images and Their Transformations. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press/Bradford Books.
  • Shorter, J.M. 1952. “Imagination.” Mind 61: 528-42.
  • Sterelny, K. 1986. “The Imagery Debate.”
  • Tidman, Paul. 1994. “Conceivability as a Test for Possibility.” American Philosophical Quarterly 31: 297-309.
  • Tipton, I. 1987. “Berkeley’s Imagination.” In Essays on the Philosophy of George Berkeley, edited by E. Sosa. Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Company (1987).
  • Tye, M. 1994. “Imagery.” In A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind, edited by Samuel Guttenplan. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers (1994): 355-61.
  • Tye, M. 1991. The Imagery Debate. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Tye, M. 1995. Ten Problems of Consciousness. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Walton, K. 1990. Mimesis as Make Believe. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • White, A. 1990. The Language of Imagination. Cambridge, Mass.: Basil Blackwell.
  • Williams, B. 1968. “Imagination and the Self.” Problems of the Self. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wittgenstein, L. 1953. Philosophical Investigations. New York: Macmillan Publishing Co.
  • Vendler, Z. 1984. The Matter of Minds. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Yablo, S. 1993. “Is Conceivability a Guide to Possibility?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 53 (1): 1-42.

Author Information

Amy Kind
Claremont McKenna College
U. s. A.


Behaviorism was a movement in psychology and philosophy that emphasized the outward behavioral aspects of thought and dismissed the inward experiential, and sometimes the inner procedural, aspects as well; a movement harking back to the methodological proposals of John B. Watson, who coined the name.  Watson's 1912 manifesto proposed abandoning Introspectionist attempts to make consciousness a subject of experimental investigation to focus instead on behavioral manifestations of intelligence.  B. F. Skinner later hardened behaviorist strictures to exclude inner physiological processes along with inward experiences as items of legitimate psychological concern.  Consequently, the successful "cognitive revolution" of the nineteen sixties styled itself a revolt against behaviorism even though the computational processes cognitivism hypothesized would be public and objective -- not the sort of private subjective processes Watson banned.  Consequently (and ironically), would-be-scientific champions of consciousness now indict cognitivism for its "behavioristic" neglect of inward experience.

The enduring philosophical interest of behaviorism concerns this methodological challenge to the scientific bona fides of consciousness (on behalf of empiricism) and, connectedly (in accord with materialism), its challenge to the supposed metaphysical inwardness, or subjectivity, of thought.  Although behaviorism as an avowed movement may have few remaining advocates, various practices and trends in psychology and philosophy may still usefully be styled "behavioristic". As long as experimental rigor in psychology is held to require "operationalization" of variables, behaviorism's methodological mark remains.  Recent attempts to revive doctrines of "ontological subjectivity" (Searle 1992) in philosophy and bring "consciousness research" under the aegis of Cognitive Science (see Horgan 1994) point up the continuing relevance of behaviorism's metaphysical and methodological challenges.

Table of Contents

  1. Behaviorists and Behaviorisms
    1. Psychological Behaviorists
      1. Precursors: Wilhelm Wundt, Ivan Pavlov
      2. John B. Watson: Early Behaviorism
      3. Intermediaries: Edward Tolman and Clark Hull
      4. B. F. Skinner: Radical Behaviorism
      5. Post-Behaviorist and Neo-behavioristic Currents: Externalism and Connectionism
    2. Philosophical Behaviorists
      1. Precursors, Preceptors, & Fellow Travelers: William James, John Dewey, Bertrand Russell
      2. Logical Behaviorism: Rudolf Carnap
      3. Ordinary Language Behaviorists: Gilbert Ryle, Ludwig Wittgenstein
      4. Reasons , Causes, and the Scientific Imperative
      5. Later Day Saints: Willard van Orman Quine and Alan Turing
      6. The Turing Test Conception: Behaviorism as Metaphysical Null Hypothesis
      7. Logical Behaviorism Metaphysically Construed
  2. Objections & Discussion
    1. Technical Difficulties
      1. Action v. Movement
      2. From Paralytics to Perfect Actors
      3. The Intentional Circle
      4. Methodological Complaints
    2. The Ur-Objection: Consciousness Denied
  3. References and Further Reading

1. Behaviorists and Behaviorisms

Behaviorism, notoriously, came in various sorts and has been, also notoriously, subject to variant sortings: "the variety of positions that constitute behaviorism" might even be said to share no common-distinctive property, but only "a loose family resemblance" (Zuriff 1985: 1) . Views commonly styled "behavioristic" share various of the following marks:

  • allegiance to the "fundamental premise ... that psychology is a natural science" and, as such, is "to be empirically based and ... objective" (Zuriff 1985: 1);
  • denial of the utility of introspection as a source of scientific data;
  • theoretic-explanatory dismissal of inward experiences or states of consciousness introspection supposedly reveals;
  • specifically antidualistic opposition to the "Cartesian theater" picture of the mind as essentially a realm of such inward experiences;
  • more broadly antiessentialist opposition to physicalist or cogntivist portrayals of thought as necessarily neurophysiological or computational;
  • theoretic-explanatory minimization of inner physiological or computational processes intervening between environmental stimulus and behavioral response;
  • mistrust of the would-be scientific character of the concepts of "folk psychology" generally, and of the would-be causal character of its central "belief-desire" pattern of explanation in particular;
  • positive characterization of the mental in terms of intelligent "adaptive" behavioral dispositions or stimulus-response patterns.

Among these features, not even Zuriff's "fundamental premise" is shared by all (and only) behaviorists. Notably, Gilbert Ryle, Ludwig Wittgenstein, and followers in the "ordinary language" tradition of analytic philosophy, while, for the most part, regarding behavioral scientific hopes as vain, hold views that are, in other respects, strongly behavioristic. Not surprisingly, these thinkers often downplay the "behaviorist" label themselves to distinguish themselves from their scientific behaviorist cousins. Nevertheless, in philosophical discussions, they are commonly counted "behaviorists": both emphasize the external behavioral aspects, deemphasize inward experiential and inner procedural aspects, and offer broadly behavioral-dispositional construals of thought.

a. Psychological Behaviorists

i. Precursors: Wilhelm Wundt, Ivan Pavlov

Wundt is often called "the father of experimental psychology." He conceived the subject matter of psychology to be "experience in its relations to the subject" (Wundt 1897: 3). The science of experience he envisaged was supposed to be chemistry like: introspected experiential data were to be analyzed; the basic constituents of conscious experience thus identified; and the patterns and laws by which these basic constituents combine to constitute more complex conscious experiences (e.g., emotions) described. Data were to be acquired and analyzed by trained introspective Observers. While the analysis of experience was supposed to be a self-contained enterprise, Wundt -- originally trained as a physiologist -- fully expected that the structures and processes introspective analysis uncovered in experience would parallel structures and processes physiological investigation revealed in the central nervous system. Introspectionism, as the approach was called, soon spread, and laboratories sprang up in the United States and elsewhere, aiming "to investigate the facts of consciousness, its combinations and relations," so as to "ultimately discover the laws which govern these relations and combinations" (Wundt 1912: 1). The approach failed primarily due to the unreliability of introspective Observation. Introspective "experimental" results were not reliably reproducible by outside laboratories: Observers from different laboratories failed to agree, for instance, in their Observation (or failure to Observe) imageless thoughts (to cite one notorious controversy).

Pavlov's successful experimental discovery the laws of classical conditioning (as they came to be called), by way of contrast, provided positive inspiration for Watson's Behaviorist manifesto. Pavlov's stimulus-response model of explanation is also paradigmatic to much later behavioristic thought. In his famous experiments Pavlov paired presentations to dogs of an unconditioned stimulus (food) with an initially neutral stimulus (a ringing bell). After a number of such joint presentations, the unconditional response to food (salivation) becomes conditioned to the bell: salivation occurs upon the ringing of the bell alone, in the absence of food. In accord with Pavlovian theory, then, given an animal's conditioning history behavioral responses (e.g., salivation) can be predicted to occur or not, and be controlled (made to occur or not), on the basis of laws of conditioning, answering to the stimulus-response pattern:

S -> R

Everything adverted to here is publicly observable, even measurable; enabling Pavlov to experimentally investigate and formulate laws concerning temporal sequencing and delay effects, stimulus intensity effects, and stimulus generalization (opening doors to experimental investigation of animal perception and discrimination).

Edward Thorndike, in a similar methodological vein, proposed "that psychology may be, at least in part, as independent of introspection as physics" (Thorndike 1911: 5) and pursued experimental investigations of animal intelligence. In experimental investigations of puzzle-solving by cats and other animals, he established that speed of solution increased gradually as a result of previous puzzle exposure. Such results, he maintained, support the hypothesis that learning is a result of habits formed through trial and error, and Thorndike formulated "laws of behavior," describing habit formation processes, based on these results. Most notable among Thorndike's laws (presaging Skinnerian operant conditioning) is his Law of Effect:

Of several responses made to the same situation, those which are accompanied or closely followed by satisfaction to the animal will, other things being equal, be more firmly connected with the situation, so that, when it recurs, they will be more likely to recur; those which are accompanied or closely followed by discomfort to the animal will, other things being equal, have their connections with that situation weakened, so that, when it recurs, they will be less likely to occur. The greater the satisfaction or discomfort, the greater the strengthening or weakening of the bond . (Thorndike 1911)

In short, rewarded responses tend to be reinforced and punished responses eliminated. His methodological innovations (particularly his "puzzle-box") facilitated objective quantitative data collection and provided a paradigm for Behaviorist research methods to follow (especially the "Skinner box").

ii. John B. Watson: Early Behaviorism

Watson coined the term "Behaviorism" as a name for his proposal to revolutionize the study of human psychology in order to put it on a firm experimental footing. In opposition to received philosophical opinion, to the dominant Introspectionist approach in psychology, and (many said) to common sense, Watson (1912) advocated a radically different approach. Where received "wisdom" took conscious experience to be the very stuff of minds and hence the (only) appropriate object of psychological investigation, Watson advocated an approach that led, scientifically, "to the ignoring of consciousness" and the illegitimacy of "making consciousness a special object of observation." He proposed, instead, that psychology should "take as a starting point, first the observable fact that organisms, man and animal alike, do adjust themselves to their environment" and "secondly, that certain stimuli lead the organisms to make responses." Whereas Introspectionism had, in Watson's estimation, miserably failed in its attempt to make experimental science out of subjective experience, the laboratories of animal psychologists, such as Pavlov and Thorndike, were already achieving reliably reproducible results and discovering general explanatory principles. Consequently, Watson -- trained as an "animal man" himself -- proposed, "making behavior, not consciousness, the objective point of our attack" as the key to putting the study of human psychology on a similar scientific footing. Key it proved to be. Watson's revolution was a smashing success. Introspectionism languished, behaviorism flourished, and considerable areas of our understanding of human psychology (particularly with regard to learning) came within the purview of experimental investigation along broadly behavioristic lines. Notably, also, Watson foreshadows Skinner's ban on appeals to inner (central nervous) processes, seeming to share the Skinnerian sentiment "that because so little is known about the central nervous system, it serves as the last refuge of the soul in psychology" (Zuriff 1985: 80). Watson is, consequently, loath to hypothesize central processes, going so far as to speculate that thought occurs in the vocal tract, and is -- quite literally -- subaudible talking to oneself (Watson 1920).

iii. Intermediaries: Edward Tolman and Clark Hull

Tolman and Hull were the two most noteworthy figures of the movement's middle years. Although both accepted the S-R framework as basic, Tolman and Hull were far more willing than Watson to hypothesize internal mechanisms or "intervening variables" mediating the S-R connection. In this regard their work may be considered precursory to cognitivism, and each touches on important philosophical issues besides. Tolman's purposive behaviorism attempts to explain goal-directed or purposive behavior, focusing on large, intact, meaningful behavior patterns or "molar" behavior (e.g., kicking a ball) as opposed to simple muscle movements or "molecular" behavior (e.g., various flexings of leg muscles); regarding the molecular level as too far removed from our perceptual capacities and explanatory purposes to provide suitable units for meaningful behavioral analysis. For Tolman, stimuli play a cognitive role as signals to the organism, leading to the formation of "cognitive maps" and to "latent learning" in the absence of reinforcement. Overall,

The stimuli which are allowed in are not connected by just simple one-to-one switches to the outgoing responses. Rather the incoming impulses are usually worked over and elaborated in the central control room into a tentative cognitive-like map of the environment. And it is this tentative map, indicating routes and paths and environmental relationships, which finally determines what responses, if any, the animal will finally make. (Tolman 1948: 192)

Clark Hull undertook the ambitious program of formulating an exhaustive theory of such mechanisms intervening between stimuli and responses: the theory was to take the form of a hypothetical-deductive system of basic laws or "postulates" enabling the prediction of behavioral responses (as "output variables") on the basis of external stimuli ("input variables") plus internal states of the organism ("intervening variables"). Including such organismic "intervening" variables (O) in the predictive/explanatory laws results in the following revised explanatory schema:

S & O -> R

The intervening O-variables Hull hypothesized included drive and habit strength. Attributes of, and relations among, these variables are what the postulates describe: further attributes and relationships were derived as theorems and corollaries from the basic postulates. Hull's student, Edward Spence, attempted to carry on with the program, without lasting success. Expected gains in predictive-explanatory scope and precision were not achieved and, with hindsight, it is easy to see that such an elaborate theoretical superstructure, built on such slight observational-experimental foundations, was bound to fall. Hull's specific proposals are presently more historical curiosities than live hypotheses. Nevertheless, currently prevalent cognitivist approaches share Hull's general commitment to internal mechanisms.

iv. B. F. Skinner: Radical Behaviorism

Skinner's self-described "radical behaviorist" approach is radical in its insistence on extending behaviorist strictures against inward experiential processes to include inner physiological ones as well. The scientific nub of the approach is a concept of operant conditioning indebted to Thorndike's "Law of Effect." Operants (e.g., bar-presses or key-pecks) are units of behavior an organism (e.g., a rat or pigeon) occasionally emits "spontaneously" prior to conditioning. In operant conditioning, operants followed by reinforcement (e.g., food or water) increase in frequency and come under control of discriminative stimuli (e.g., lights or tones) preceding the response. By increasingly judicious reinforcement of increasingly close approximations, complex behavioral sequences are shaped. On Skinner's view, high-level human behavior, such as speech, is the end result of such shaping. Prolonged absence of reinforcement leads to extinction of the response. Many original and important Skinnerian findings -- e.g., that constantly reinforced responses extinguish more rapidly than intermittently reinforced responses -- concern the effects of differing schedules of reinforcement. Skinner notes the similarity of operant behavioral conditioning to natural evolutionary selection: in each case apparently forward-looking or goal-directed developments are explained (away) by a preceding course of environmental "selection" among randomly varying evolutionary traits or, in the psychological case, behavioral tricks. The purposiveness which Tolman's molar behavioral description assumes, radical behaviorism thus claims to explain. Likewise, Skinner questions the explanatory utility of would-be characterizations of inner processes (such as Hull's): such processes, being behavior themselves (though inner), are more in need of explanation themselves, Skinner holds, than they are fit to explain outward behavior. By "dismissing mental states and processes," Skinner maintains, radical behaviorism "directs attention to the ... history of the individual and to the current environment where the real causes of behavior are to be found" (Skinner 1987: 75). On this view, "if the proper attention is paid to the variables controlling behavior and an appropriate behavioral unit is chosen, orderliness appears directly in the behavior and the postulated theoretical processes become superfluous" (Zuriff: 88). Thus understood, Skinner's complaint about inner processes "is not that they do not exist, but that they are not relevant" (Skinner 1953) to the prediction, control, and experimental analysis of behavior.

Skinner stressed prediction and control as his chief explanatory desiderata, and on this score he boasts that "experimental analysis of behaviour" on radical behaviorist lines "has led to an effective technology, applicable to education, psychotherapy, and the design of cultural practices in general" (Skinner 1987: 75). Even the most strident critics of radical behaviorism, I believe, must accord it some recognition in these connections. Behavior therapy (based on operant principles) has proven effective in treating phobias and addictions; operant shaping is widely and effectively used in animal training; and behaviorist instructional methods have proven effective -- though they may have become less fashionable -- in the field of education. Skinnerian Behaviorism can further boast of significantly advancing our understanding of stimulus generalization and other important learning-and-perception related phenomena and effects. Nevertheless, what was delivered was less than advertised. In particular, Skinner's attempt to extend the approach to the explanation of high-grade human behavior failed, making Noam Chomsky's dismissive (1959) review of Skinner's book, Verbal Behavior, something of a watershed. On Chomsky's diagnosis, not only had Skinner's attempt at explaining verbal behavior failed, it had to fail given the insufficiency of the explanatory devices Skinner allowed: linguistic competence (in general) and language acquisition (in particular), Chomsky argued, can only be explained as expressions of innate mechanisms -- presumably, computational mechanisms. For those in the "behavioral sciences" already chaffing under the severe methodological constraints Skinnerian orthodoxy imposed, the transition to "cognitive science" was swift and welcome. By 1985 Zuriff would write, "the received wisdom of today is that behaviorism has been refuted, its methods have failed, and it has little to offer modern psychology" (Zuriff 1985: 278). Subsequent developments, however, suggest that matters are not that simple.

v. Post-Behaviorist and Neo-behavioristic Currents: Externalism and Connectionism

Several recent developments inside and beside the mainstream of "cognitive science" -- though their proponents have not been keen to style themselves "behaviorists" -- appear to be rather behavioristic. Semantic externalism is the view that "meanings ain't in the head" (Putnam 1975: 227) but depend, rather, on environmental factors; especially on sensory and behavioral intercourse with the referents of the referring thoughts or expressions. If emphasis on the outward or behavioral aspects of thought or intelligence -- and attendant de-emphasis of inward experiential or inner procedural aspects -- is the hallmark of behaviorism, semantic externalism is, on its face, behavioristic (though this is seldom remarked). Emphasis (as by Burge 1979) on social (besides the indexical, or sensory-behavioral) determinants of reference -- on what Putnam called "the linguistic division of labor" -- lends this view a distinct Wittgensteinean flavor besides. Such externalist "causal theories" of reference, although far from unquestioned orthodoxy, are currently among the leading cognitive scientific contenders. Less orthodox, but even more behavioristic, is the procedural externalism advocated by Andy Clark (2001), inspired by work in "Situated Cognition, Distributed and Decentralized Cognition, Real-World Robotics, and Artificial Life" (Clark 2001: abstract); identifying thought with "complex and iterated processes which continually loop between brain, body, and technological environment"; according to which the "intelligent process just is the spatially and temporally extended one which zig-zags between brain, body, and world" (Clark 2001: 132). Perhaps most importantly, the influential connectionist hypothesis that the brain does parallel processing of distributed representations, rather than serial processing of localized (language-like) representations, also waxes behavioristic. In parallel systems, typically, initial programming (comparable to innate mechanisms) is minimal and the systems are "trained-up" to perform complex tasks over a series of trails, by a process somewhat like operant shaping.

b. Philosophical Behaviorists

i. Precursors, Preceptors, & Fellow Travelers: William James, John Dewey, Bertrand Russell

In opposition to the "Structuralist" philosophical underpinnings of introspectionism, behaviorism grew out of a competing "Functionalist" philosophy of psychology that counted Dewey and William James among its leading advocates. Against structuralist reification of the content of experience, Dewey urged that sensations be given a functional characterization, and proposed to treat them as functionally defined occupants of roles in the "reflex arc" which -- since it "represents both the unit of nerve structure and the type of nerve function" -- should supply the "unifying principle and controlling working hypothesis in psychology" (Dewey 1896: 357); though the arc, Dewey insisted, is misunderstood if not viewed in broader organic-adaptive context. On another front -- against structuralist reification of the subject of experience -- William James famously maintained,

that 'consciousness,' when once it has evaporated to this estate of pure diaphaneity, is on the point of disappearing altogether. It is the name of a nonentity, and has no right to a place among first principles. Those who still cling to it are clinging to a mere echo, the faint rumor left behind by the disappearing 'soul' upon the air of philosophy.

James hastened to add, that he meant "only to deny that the word [`consciousness'] stands for an entity, but to insist most emphatically that it does stand for a function" (James 1912). The James-Lange theory of emotions -- which holds that "the bodily changes follow directly the PERCEPTION of the exciting fact, and that our feeling of the same changes as they occur IS the emotion (James 1884: 189-190) -- prefigures later behavioristic deflationary analyses of other categories of presumed mentation.

Bertrand Russell was among the first philosophers to recognize the philosophical significance of the behaviorist revolution Watson proposed. Though never a card-carrying behaviorist himself -- insisting that the inwardness or "privacy" of "sense-data" "does not by itself make [them] unamenable to scientific treatment" (Russell 1921: 119) -- Russell, nevertheless, asserted that behaviorism "contains much more truth than people suppose" and regarded it "as desirable to develop the behaviourist method to the fullest possible extent" (Russell 1927: 73), proposing a united front between behaviorism and science-friendly analytic philosophy of mind. Such fronts soon emerged on both the "formal language" and "ordinary language" sides of ongoing analytic philosophical debate.

ii. Logical Behaviorism: Rudolf Carnap

What is sometimes called the "formalist" or "ideal language" line of analytic philosophy seeks the logical and empirical regimentation of (would-be) scientific language for the sake of its scientific improvement. "Logical behaviorism" refers, most properly, to Carnap and Hempel's proposed regimentation of psychological discourse on behavioristic lines, calling for analyses of mental terms along lines consonant with the Logical Empiricist doctrine of verificationism (resembling the "operationism" of P.W. Bridgman 1927) they espoused. According to verificationism, a theoretic attribution -- say of temperature -- as in "it's 23.4º centigrade" "affirms nothing other than" that certain "physical test sentences obtain": sentences describing the would-be "coincidence between the level of the mercury and the mark of the scale numbered 23.4" on a mercury thermometer, and "other coincidences," for other measuring instruments (Hempel 1949: 16-17). Similarly, it was proposed, that for scientific psychological purposes, "the meaning of a psychological statement consists solely in the function of abbreviating the description of certain modes of physical response characteristic of the bodies of men and animals" (Hempel 1949: 19), the modes of physical response by which we test the truth of our psychological attributions. "Paul has a toothache" for instance would abbreviate "Paul weeps and makes gestures of such and such kinds"; "At the question `What is the matter?,' Paul utters the words `I have a toothache'"; and so on (Hempel 1949: 17). As Carnap and Hempel came to give up verificationism, they gave up logical behaviorism, and came to hold, instead, that "the introduction and application of psychological terms and hypotheses is logically and methodologically analogous to the introduction and application of the terms and hypotheses of a physical theory." Theoretical terms on this newly emerging (and now prevalent) view need only be loosely tied to observational tests in concert with other terms of the theory. They needn't be fully characterized, each in terms of its own observations, as on the "narrow translationist" (Hempel 1977: 14) doctrine of logical behaviorism. As verificationism went, so went logical behaviorism: liberalized requirements for the empirical grounding of theoretical posits encouraged the taking of "cognitive scientific" liberties (in practice) and (in theory) the growth of cognitivist sympathies among analytic philosophers of mind. Still, despite having been renounced by its champions as unfounded and having found no new champions; and despite seeming, with hindsight, clearly false; logical behaviorism continues to provoke philosophical discussion, perhaps due to that very clarity. Appreciation of how logical behaviorism went wrong (below) is widely regarded by cognitivists as the best propaedeutic to their case for robust recourse to hypotheses about internal computational mechanisms.

iii. Ordinary Language Behaviorists: Gilbert Ryle, Ludwig Wittgenstein

The "ordinary language" movement waxed most strongly in the work of Ryle and Wittgenstein around the middle of the twentieth century. Their investigations are "meant to throw light on the facts of our language" in its everyday employment (Wittgenstein 1953: §130). Where the formalist seeks the logical and empirical regimentation of would-be scientific language, including psychological terms, Ryle and Wittgenstein regard our everyday use of mental terminology as unimpeached by its scientific "defects" ... which are not defects ... because such talk is not in the scientific line of business. To misconstrue talk of people "as knowing, believing, or guessing something, as hoping, dreading, intending or shirking something, as designing this or being amused at that" (Ryle 1949: 15) on the model of scientific hypotheses about inner mechanisms misconstrues the "logical grammar" (Wittgenstein) of such talk, or makes a "category-mistake" (Ryle). Philosophical puzzlements about knowledge of other minds and mind-body interaction arise from such misconstrual: for instance, attempts to solve the mind-body problem, Ryle claims, "presuppose the legitimacy of the disjunction `Either there exist minds or there exist bodies (but not both)'" which "would be like saying, `Either she bought a left-hand and a right-hand glove or she bought a pair of gloves (but not both)'" (Ryle 1949: 22-3). The most basic misconstrual (Wittgenstein's and Ryle's diagnoses concur) involves thinking -- when we talk of "knowing, believing, or guessing," etc. -- "that these verbs are supposed to denote the occurrence of specific modifications" either mechanical (in brains) or "paramechanical" (in streams of consciousness):

So we have to deny the yet uncomprehended process in the yet unexplored medium. And now it looks as if we have denied the mental processes. And naturally we don't want to deny them." (Wittgenstein 1953: §308)

Not wanting to deny, e.g., "that anyone ever remembers anything" (Wittgenstein 1953: §306) Wittgenstein and Ryle offer broadly dispositional stories about how mentalistic talk does work, in place of "the model of 'object and designation'" (Wittgenstein 1953: §293) they reject.

According to Wittgenstein on the object-designation model -- where the object is supposed to be private or introspected -- it "drops out of consideration as irrelevant" (Wittgenstein 1953: §293): the "essential thing about private experience" here is "not that each person possesses his own exemplar" but "that nobody knows whether other people also have this or something else" (§272). So, if "someone tells me that he knows what pain is only from his own case" this would be as if

everyone had a box with something in it: we call it a `beetle'. No one can look in anyone else's box, and everyone says he knows what a beetle is only by looking at his beetle. -- Here it would be quite possible for everyone to have something different in his box. One might even imagine such a thing constantly changing. -- But suppose the word `beetle' had a use in these people's language? -- If so, it would not be used as the name of a thing. The thing in the box has no place in the language-game at all; not even as a something: for the box might even be empty. -- No, one can `divide through' by the thing in the box; it cancels out, whatever it is. (§293)

Rather than referring to inner experiences, sensation words, according to Wittgenstein, "are connected with the primitive, the natural, expressions of the sensation and used in their place" (§246): self-attributions of "pain" and other sensation terms are avowals not descriptions: "A child has hurt himself and he cries; and then adults talk to him and teach him exclamations and, later, sentences. They teach the child new pain-behaviour." Here, Wittgenstein explains, he is not "saying that the word `pain' really means crying": rather, "the verbal expression of pain replaces crying and does not describe it" (§244). Avowals join the "natural expressions" to supply the "outward criteria" which logically (not just evidentially) constrain and enable the uses sensation and other "`inner process'" words have in our public language (§580). Furthermore, Wittgenstein famously argues, we cannot even coherently imagine a private language "in which a person could write down or give vocal expression to his inner experiences" exclusively "for his private use" because the "private ostensive definition" (§380) required to fix the reference of the would-be sensation-denoting expression could not establish a rule for its use. "To think one is obeying a rule is not to obey a rule" and in the case of usage consequent on the envisaged private baptism "thinking one was obeying a rule would be the same thing as ... obeying" (§202).

For Ryle, when we employ the "verbs, nouns and adjectives, with which in ordinary life we describe the wits, characters, and higher-grade performances of people with whom we have do" (Ryle 1949: 15) "we are not referring to occult episodes of which their overt acts and utterances are effects; we are referring to those overt acts and utterances themselves" (25) or else to a "disposition, or a complex of dispositions" (15) to such acts and utterances. "Dispositional words like `know', `believe', `aspire', `clever', and `humorous''' signify multi-track dispositions: "abilities, tendencies or pronenesses to do, not things of one unique kind, but things of lots of different kinds" (118): "to explain an action as done from a specified motive or inclination is not to describe the action as the effect of a specified cause": being dispositions, motives "are not happenings and are not therefore of the right type to be causes" (113). Accordingly, "to explain an act as done from a certain motive is not analogous to saying that the glass broke, because a stone hit it, but to the quite different type of statement that the glass broke, when the stone hit it, because the glass was brittle" (87). The force of such explanation is not "to correlate [the action explained] with some occult cause, but to subsume it under a propensity or behavior trend" (110). The explanation does not prescind from the act to its causal antecedents but redescribes the act in broader context, telling "a more pregnant story," as when we explain the bird's "flying south" as "migration"; yet, Ryle observes," the process of migrating is not a different process from that of flying south; so it is not the cause of its flying south" (142). Finally, the connection between disposition and deed, as Ryle understands it, is a logical-criterial, not a contingent-causal one: brave deeds are not caused by bravery, they constitute it (as the "soporific virtue," or sleep-inducing power, of opium doesn't cause it to induce sleep since tending to induce sleep is this power or "virtue").

iv. Reasons , Causes, and the Scientific Imperative

For formalists, the informality and imprecision of ordinary language formulations invite criticism. Take Ryle's "migration" comparison: either, it would seem, Ryle is saying that everyday psychological explanations yield only vague interpretive understanding, having no scope for scientific development; or else, it would seem, the "more pregnant story" must be formalizable in terms of predictive-explanatory laws (as of migration, in Ryle's example) with logical-behaviorial-definition-like rigor (if not content). The point of logical behaviorist analysis is to scientifically ground talk of "belief," "desire," "sensation," and the rest, whose everyday use seems empirically precarious. With this aim in mind, "explanatory" procession from low-level matter-of-fact description ("flying south") to more interpretive description ("migration"), such as Ryle envisages, seems to move in the wrong direction ... unless, again, the "more pregnant story" is not just redescriptive but delivers scientific theoretic gains in the form of more general and precise explantory-predictive laws. A related debate raged fiercely through the nineteen fifties and early sixties between defenders of the (would-be) scientific status of "motive" or "belief-desire" explanations (notably Hempel) and champions of the Rylean thesis that "reasons aren't causes" (Elizabeth Anscombe and Stuart Hampshire, among them). Donald Davidson's (1963) defense of "the ancient -- and commonsense -- position that rationalization is a species of causal explanation" is widely recognized as a watershed in this debate, though it remains doubtful to what extent cognivists retain rights to the water shed, since Davidson counts reasons to be causal in virtue of noncognitive (low-level physical) properties. On the other hand, philosophers in the ordinary language tradition (e.g., Hampshire 1950, Geach 1957) raised daunting technical difficulties (below) for the "narrow translationist" plans of logical behaviorism. Such criticisms hastened the advent of cognitivism as an alternative to behaviorism of any stripe among philosophers unwilling to abide the informality, imprecision, and seeming scientific defeatism of the ordinary language approach.

v. Later Day Saints: Willard van Orman Quine aand Alan Turing

Quine, considered by many to be the greatest Anglo-American philosopher of the last half of the twentieth century, was a self-avowed "behaviorist," and such tendencies are evident in several areas of his thought, beginning with his enthusiasm for a linguistic turn (as Bergmann 1964 styled it: see Rorty 1967) in the philosophy of mind. "A theory of mind," Quine writes, "can gain clarity and substance ... from a better understanding of the workings of language, whereas little understanding of the working of language is to be hoped for in mentalistic terms" (Quine 1975: 84). Quine's "naturalized" inquiries concerning knowledge and language attempt, further, to incorporate empirical findings and methods from Skinnerian psychology. In contrast to logical behaviorism (above), notably, Quine "never ... aspired to the ascetic adherence to operational definitions" and always acknowledged -- indeed insisted -- that science "settles for partial criteria and for partial explanations" of its theoretic posits "in terms of other partially explained notions" (Quine 1990: 291). Still, he is not keen -- as his cognitivist contemporaries (for example, Putnam) and followers (for example, Fodor) are -- about the prospects such looser empiricist strictures offer for scientific deployment of mentalistic vernacular terms like "belief," "desire," and "sensation". To standard behaviorist concern about the empirical credentials of alleged private entities and introspective reports, Quine adds the consideration that talk of "belief", "desire", and other intentional mental states is so logically ill-behaved as to be irreconcilable with materialism and scientifically unredeemable. In the final analysis, however, the behaviorism Quine proposes is methodological. His final metaphysical word is physicalism: "having construed behavioral dispositions in turn as physiological states, I end up with the so called identity theory of mind: mental states are states of the body" (Quine 1975: 94); yet, his antiessentialism here (as elsewhere) lends his physicalism a behavioristic cast (see next section).

Alan Turing is transitional. Along with the digital age, his theory of computation helped inspire the cognitivist revolution, making him, by some lights the first cognitivist. On the other hand, the methodological behaviorism of Turing's proposed Imitation Game test for artificial intelligence (the "Turing test") has been widely remarked and "the Turing test conception" of intelligence may be considered a parade case of metaphysical behaviorism for purposes of refutation (as by Block 1981) or illustration (as follows).

vi. The Turing Test Conception: Behaviorism as Metaphysical Null Hypothesis

The Imitation Game proposed by Turing (1950) was originally a game of female impersonation: the aim of the game for the (male) querant is to pass for (that is, be judged by the questioner to be) female. The Turing test replaces the male querant with a computer whose aim is to pass for human. This simplified setup (Turing's actual proposal involves an additional complication, a third participant or foil besides to the querant and questioner) can be used to explain the metaphysical character of the dispute as a dispute about essence. In the original (man-woman) Imitation Game, notice, however good the impersonation, it doesn't make the querant female. Something else is essential: it's the content of their chromosomes (not their conversation) that makes the querant female or not. Different proposals for what that essential something is in the case of thought, then, represent different metaphysical takes on the nature of mind. In the Turing test scenario these different [proposed essences] represent further conditions necessary to promote intelligent-seeming behavior into actual intelligence, and sufficing for intelligence, or mentation, even in the absence of such behavior.

Dualistic Essentialism: S -> [(the right) conscious experiential processes] -> R
Physicalistic Essentialism: S -> [(the right) physical processes] -> R
Cognitivistic Essentialism: S -> [(the right) computational processess] -> R
Behavioristic Inessentialism: S -> [whatever works] -> R

Dualistic theories propose a conscious experiential essence; physicalistic (or "mind-brain identity") theories propose a physical (specifically, neurophysiological) essence; and cognitivistic theories a procedural or computational essence. Behaviorism, in contrast, doesn't care what mediates the intelligent-seeming S -> R connection; behavioristically speaking, intelligence is as intelligence does regardless of the manner of the doing (experiential, neurophysiological, computational, or otherwise). Behaviorism, thus construed, "is not a metaphysical theory: it is the denial of a metaphysical theory" and consequently "asserts nothing" (Ziff 1958: 136); at least, nothing positively metaphysical.

vii. Logical Behaviorism Metaphysically Construed

Logical behaviorism may be seen, in the light of the preceding, as attempting to stipulate nominal essences (Locke 1690: IIiii15) where dualism, physicalism, and cognitivism propose to discover real ones. Further, although the motives of its founders (Carnap and Hempel) were chiefly epistemic or "methodological," logical behaviorism seemed to many to invite metaphysical exploitation. Because the definitions Carnap and Hempel proposed sought to specify observationally necessary and sufficient conditions for true attributions of the mental terms in what they called "the physical thing language," the successful completion of this program, it seemed, would reduce the mental to the physical. Mentalistic descriptions of people as "expecting pain" or "having toothaches" would be completely replaceable, in principle and without cognitive loss, by talk of bodily transitions; thoughts and experiences would thus be shown to be nothing above and beyond such bodily transitions; vindicating materialism. As the the methodological emphasis of early analytic philosophy receded and was replaced by more frankly metaphysical concerns among formalist analytic philosophers of mind, it was chiefly this would-be metaphysical application of logical behaviorism that came increasingly under philosophical scrutiny.

2. Objections & Discussion

a. Technical Difficulties

i. Action v. Movement

Ordinary language philosophers were among the first to raise daunting difficulties for the strict translationist program which, they argued, was guilty of a category mistake -- or at least of wildly underestimating the impracticability of what they were proposing -- in conflating the concepts of action and movement under the heading of "behavior." As D. W. Hamlyn puts this complaint, "where activity is exhibited, it is not necessarily inappropriate to talk of movements, but it will be so to do so in the same context, in the same universe of discourse":

With movements we are concerned with physical phenomena, the laws concerning which are in principle derivable from the laws of physics. But the behaviour which we call "posting a letter" or "kicking a ball" involves a very complex series of movements, and the same movements will not be exhibited on all occasions on which we should describe the behavior in the same way. No fixed criteria can be laid down which will enable us to decide what series of movements shall constitute "posting a letter." Rather we have learnt to interpret a varying range of movements as coming up to the rough standard which we observe in acknowledging a correct description of such behaviour as posting a letter. (Hamlyn 1953: 134-135)

The task of defining mentalistic predications such as "wanting to score a goal" in terms of outward acts -- or dispositions to acts -- like kicking a ball (Tolman's "molar behavior") seems daunting enough; the task of casting the definition in terms of movements or "molecular behavior" -- "colorless movements and mere receptor impulses" (Watson), "motions and noises" (Ryle) -- seems beyond daunting.

ii. From Paralytics to Perfect Actors

If the mental were completely definable in outwardly behavioral terms -- as logical behaviorism proposes -- then outward behavioral capacities or dispositions would be necessary for thought or experience. But a complete paralytic, it seems, might still think thoughts (e.g., I can't move), harbor desires (e.g., to move) and experience (e.g., despairing) sensations. Such possibilities are, on their face, contrary to logical behaviorism. From the logical behaviorist perspective, while such cases may complicate the description of the mental in behavioral terms, they do not seem fatal. It may be replied, e.g., that wanting to move is being disposed to move if able and, since the various possible causes of the disability (severed spinal cords, curare poisoning, etc.) are physically specifiable, this envisaged complication is wholly consistent with behaviorist strictures and reductionist hopes. Hilary Putnam's imagined super-super-spartans ("X-worlders") are less easily countered. X-worlders (as Putnam called them) "suppress all ... pain behavior" by "a great effort of will" for "what they regard as important ideological reasons" (Putnam 1963: 332-334). Like paralytics, these super-super-spartans "lack the behavioral dispositions envisioned by the behaviorists to be associated with pain, even though they do in fact have pain" (Block 1981: 12); but, unlike paralytics, they lack these dispositions for psychological reasons: efforts of will undertaken for ideological reasons -- unlike severed spinal cords and doses of curare -- would not be physically specifiable and any envisaged complications of the behavioral definitions attempting to build exceptions for these causes would be inconsistent with behaviorist strictures and reductionist hopes. And contrary to the sufficiency of behavior for pain that logical behaviorist definitions would imply, "an exactly analogous example of perfect pain-pretenders shows that no behavioral disposition is sufficient for pain either" (Block 1981: 12: emphasis added).

iii. The Intentional Circle

Among the technical arguments against logical behaviorism, the most influential has been the "intentional circle" argument harking back to Chisholm (1957, ch. 11) and Geach (1957, p. 8): indeed the perfect actor line of counterexamples "flows out of the Chisholm-Geach point" as Block (1981:12) notes. A desire to stay dry, for instance, will dispose you to carry an umbrella only on the condition that you believe it might rain; and, conversely, the belief it might rain will dispose you to carry an umbrella only on the condition that you desire to stay dry. Such Geach-Chisholm type examples show that "which behavioral dispositions a desire issues in depends on other states of the desirer. And similar points apply to behaviorist analyses of belief and other mental states" (Block 1981: 12). While this point is most plain with respect to intentional mental states such as belief and desire, perfect actor examples seem to show it to extend to sensations, such as pain, as well: "a disposition to pain behavior is not a sufficient condition of having pain, since the behavioral disposition could be produced by a number of different combinations of mental states, e.g., [pain + a normal preference function] or by [no pain + an overwhelming desire to appear to have pain]" (Block 1981: 15); and, conversely, the dispositions are not a necessary condition since unpained-behavior dispositions might be produced by, e.g. [no pain + a normal preference function] or by [pain + an overwhelming desire to appear not to have pain]. "Conclusion: one cannot define the conditions under which a given mental state will issue in a given behavioral disposition" as logical behaviorism proposes "without adverting to other mental states" (Block 1981: 12), which logical behaviorism precludes. Such arguments are widely "regarded as decisive refutations of behaviorist analyses of many mental states, such as belief, desire, and pain" (Block 1981: 13). The "functionalist" doctrine that a mental state is "definable in terms of its causal relations to inputs, outputs, and other mental states" (Block 1980: 257), not to inputs and outputs alone (a la logical behaviorism), also flows directly from the Geach-Chisholm point.

In truth, as Putnam himself notes, whether refutation of the "admittedly oversimplified position" of logical behaviorism refutes behaviorism tout court depends on the extent to which "the defects which this position exhibits are also exhibited by the more complex and sophisticated positions which are actually held" (Putnam 1957: 95). Notably, perfect actor and other would-be thought experimental counterexamples to behaviorism would counterexemplify metaphysical construals which those who have actually held "the more complex and sophisticated positions" at issue, for the most part, explicitly disavow. Also, notably, Ryle's characterization of intentional mental states (in particular) as multi-track "dispositions the exercises of which are indefinitely heterogenous" (Ryle 1949: 44) seems already to allow for intentional "circularity": Tolman and Hull-style behaviorism even explicitly embraces it. For refutation of behaviorism tout court to be claimed, cognitivism would be have to be so simply identified with the view that a mental state is "definable in terms of its causal relations to inputs, outputs, and other mental states" that Tolman, Hull, and Ryle, count as cognitivists. That's too simple. One may agree "that the logically necessary and sufficient conditions for the ascription of a mental state" would have to "refer not just to environmental variables but to other mental states of the organism" (Fodor 1975: 7 n.7) -- that mental attributions have to be reduced all together (or holistically) not one by one (atomistically) -- yet behavioristically refuse the call for further computational (or physical or phenomenological) constraints on what count as mental states. The "faith that ... one will surely get to pure behavioral ascriptions" -- motions and noises -- "if only one pursues the analysis far enough" (Fodor 1975: 7 n.7) is also behavioristically dispensable. Notably these two tacks have their costs: the first abandons hope for essential scientific characterization of the mental. The second abandons hope for reductionist exploitation of behaviorist ideas on behalf of materialism. So chastened, behaviorism, while defensible, seems, to many, too boring to merit further philosophical bother.

iv. Methodological Complaints

Fodor's summation of the complaint against against methodological behaviorism is succinct: by it, he maintains, "[p]sychology is ... deprived of its theoretical terms" meaning "psychologists can provide methodologically reputable accounts only of such aspects of behavior as are the effects of environmental variables"; but "the spontaneity and freedom from local environmental control that behavior often exhibits" makes "this sort of methodology intolerably restrictive" (Fodor 1975: 1-2). Furthermore, "there would seem to be nothing in the project of explaining behavior by reference to mental processes which requires a commitment to [their] epistemological privacy in the traditional sense" of conscious subjectivity. "Indeed," Fodor continues, "for better or worse, a materialist cannot accept such a commitment since his view is that mental events are a species of physical events, and physical events are publicly observable, at least in principle" (Fodor 1975: 4): the commitment is to inner computational not inward experiential processes. However, while Fodor 1975 adduces, "failure of behavioristic psychology to provide even a first approximation to a plausible theory of cognition" (Fodor 1975: 8) in support of cognitivist alternatives, Fodor 2000 confesses "that the most interesting -- certainly the hardest -- problems about thinking are unlikely to be much illuminated by any kind of computational theory we are now able to imagine" (Fodor 2000: 1). As for more isolated or "modular" processes (e.g., syntactic processing) where the "Computational Theory of Mind" by Fodor's lights remains "by far the best theory of cognition that we've got; indeed, the only one we've got that's worth the bother" (Fodor 2000: 1) ... here, where, in Fodor's judgment, behaviorism failed "to provide even a first approximation of a plausible theory," cognitivism may be faulted with producing too many: elaborate theoretical superstructures built on slight observational-experimental foundations reminiscent of Hull's. Notably, since Chomsky's watershed "Review of Verbal Behavior by B. F. Skinner" Chomsky himself has held at least four distinct syntactic theories, and his currently fashionable "Minimalist Theory" presently competes with at least five distinct others. (Chomsky's four theories (in chronological order) have been Transformational Grammar (1965), Extended Standard Theory (1975), Government and Binding (1984), and Minimalism (1995). Competing theories include, notably, Lexical Function Grammar (Bresnan), Head-Driven Phrase Structure Grammar (Sag, Pollard), Functionalism (see Newmeyer), Categorial Grammar (Steedman), and Stratificational Grammar (Lamb).)

b. The Ur-Objection: Consciousness Denied

Behaviorism's disregard for consciousness struck many from the first, and continues to strike many today, as contrary to plain self-experience and plain common-sense; not to mention all that makes life precious and meaningful. In this vein behaviorism has been "likened to `Hamlet' without the Prince of Denmark" (Ryle 1949: 328) and behaviorists accused of "affecting general anesthesia" (Ogden & Richards 1926: 23) and made the butt of jokes in the vein of the following (see Ziff 1958):

Q: What does one behaviorist say to another when they meet on the street?
A: You're fine. How am I?
Q: What does one behaviorist say to another after sex?
A: That was great for you. How was it for me?

In the same vein as John Searle still complains "the behaviorist seems to leave out the mental phenomena in question," (Searle 1992: 34), E. B. Titchener complained, at the movement's outset, of behaviorism's "irrelevance to psychology as psychology is ordinarily understood" (Titchener 1914: 6). On the other hand Titchener's prediction -- that, due to this irrelevance, introspective psychology would continue to flourish alongside behaviorism -- with hindsight, seems a bit laughable itself. As Ryle puts it, "the extruded hero," consciousness, for scientific purposes, "soon came to seem so bloodless and spineless a being that even the opponents of these [behaviorist] theories began to feel shy of imposing heavy burdens upon his spectral shoulders" (Ryle 1949: 328). Ryle's countercomplaint still rings true today despite recent attempts to revive consciousness as a subject of serious scientific inquiry; or, more to the point especially, in light of such attempts, which all, in one way or another, seek to revive the Wundtian program of correlating introspected experiential with observed neurophysiological events. While it may be urged that the hero was never wholly extruded but has been lurking all along in the caves of psychophysics (e.g., in correlations of physical stimulus variations with noticed differences in sensation), recent attempts to extend this psychology-as-psychophysics approach beyond psychophysics remain nascent at best.

"Imagery from Galton on has been the inner stronghold of a psychology based on introspection" (Watson 1913: 421) and here, with regard to direct sensory presentations (e.g., afterimages) and sensations (e.g., pain) -- so-called qualia -- the "neglect of consciousness" complaint against behaviorism is most acutely felt; and here it must be confessed that behaviorist replies have been mostly halting and evasive. Watson, confessing, "I may have to grant a few sporadic cases of imagery to him who will not be otherwise convinced" would marginalize the phenomena, insisting, "that the images of such a one are as sporadic and as unnecessary to his well-being and well-thinking as a few hairs more or less on his head" (Watson 1913: 423n.3) -- a verdict Ryle deems confirmed. Scientifically, the "extruded hero," it seems, can neither explanans nor explanandum be. Inward experience seems, scientifically, as nonexplanatory (of intentionality, intelligence, or other features of mind we should like to explain) as it seems itself scientifically inexplicable. Nevertheless, Ryle frankly confesses that "there is something seriously amiss" with his own treatment of sensations (Ryle 1949: 240) and, even, "not to know the right idioms to discuss these matters" in behavioristic good conscience; only hoping, his "discussion of them in the official idioms may have at least some internal Fifth Column efficacy" (Ryle 1949: 201). Still, inward experiences seem just as unaccountable on inner computational grounds as on outward behavioral ones -- Kossyln's 1980 data structural analysis of images as two dimensional data arrays, e.g., leaves their qualia still unaccounted for. Behavioristic losses on the count of qualia are, by no means, cognitivistic gains. Cognitivism itself "has been plagued by two `qualia' centered objections" in particular: the Inverted Qualia Objection that, possibly, e.g., "though you and I have exactly the same functional organization, the sensation that you have when you look at red things is phenomenally the same as the sensation that I have when I look at green things" (Block 1980: 257); and the Absent Qualia Objection "that it is possible that a mental state of a person x be functionally identical to a state of y, even though x's state has qualitative character while y's state lacks qualitative character altogether" (Block 1980: 258).

Methodologically, then, the matter of consciousness remains about where Watson left it, as scientifically intractable as it seems morally crucial and common-sensically inescapable. Unless there is more scientific gold in those psychophysical hills than recently renewed attempts to mine them by Crick (1994) Edelman (1989) and others (see Horgan 1994) suggest, this is apt to be where matters remain for the foreseeable future. Notice, metaphysical dualism (identifying mental events with private, subjective, nonphysical, "modes" of conscious experience) may be held consistently with methodological behavioristic commitment to the explanatory superfluity of such factors by disallowing such events their apparent causal roles in the generation of behavior. Epiphenomenalism denies their causal efficacy altogether. Parallelism just denies their "downward" (mental-to-physical) causal efficacy. It is due, largely, to their reluctance to embrace such drastic expedients as parallelism and epiphenomenalism that, despite recently renewed would-be scientific interest in consciousness, most cognitive scientists and allied analytic philosophers continue to reject metaphysical dualism -- remaining true to their metaphysical, along with their methodological, behavioral roots.

The enduring cogency of behaviorism's challenge to the scientific bona fides of consciousness means that methodologically, at least, there seems no viable alternative to "practically everybody in cognitive science" remaining -- if not "a behaviorist of one sort or another" (Fodor 2001: 13-14) -- at least, behavioristic in some manner. Cognitive Science killed Behaviorism, they say. Still, Cognitive Science seems entitled to its last name only on condition that it retain a good measure of behavioristic conscience.

3. References and Further Reading

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  • Chomsky, Noam. Lectures on Government and Binding: The Pisa Lectures. Dordrecht Holland: Foris Publications, 1984.
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Author Information

Larry Hauser
Alma College
U. S. A.

Evolutionary Ethics

Evolutionary ethics tries to bridge the gap between philosophy and the natural sciences by arguing that natural selection has instilled human beings with a moral sense, a disposition to be good. If this were true, morality could be understood as a phenomenon that arises automatically during the evolution of sociable, intelligent beings and not, as theologians or philosophers might argue, as the result of divine revelation or the application of our rational faculties. Morality would be interpreted as a useful adaptation that increases the fitness of its holders by providing a selective advantage. This is certainly the view of Edward O. Wilson, the "father" of sociobiology, who believes that "scientists and humanists should consider together the possibility that the time has come for ethics to be removed temporarily from the hands of the philosophers and biologicized" (Wilson, 1975: 27). The challenge for evolutionary biologists such as Wilson is to define goodness with reference to evolutionary theory and then explain why human beings ought to be good.

Table of Contents

  1. Key Figures and Key Concepts
    1. Charles Darwin
    2. Herbert Spencer
    3. The Is-Ought Problem
    4. The Naturalistic Fallacy
    5. Sociobiology
  2. Placement in Contemporary Ethical Theory
  3. Challenges for Evolutionary Ethics
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Key Figures and Key Concepts

a. Charles Darwin

The biologization of ethics started with the publication of The Descent of Man by Charles Darwin (1809-1882) in 1871. In this follow-up to On the Origin of Species, Darwin applied his ideas about evolutionary development to human beings. He argued that humans must have descended from a less highly organized form--in fact, from a "hairy, tailed quadruped ... inhabitant of the Old World" (Darwin, 1930: 231). The main difficulty Darwin saw with this explanation is the high standard of moral qualities apparent in humans. Faced with this puzzle, Darwin devoted a large chapter of the book to evolutionary explanations of the moral sense, which he argued must have evolved in two main steps.

First, the root for human morality lies in the social instincts (ibid. 232). Building on this claim by Darwin, today's biologists would explain this as follows. Sociability is a trait whose phylogenetic origins can be traced back to the time when birds "invented" brooding, hatching, and caring for young offspring. To render beings able to fulfill parental responsibilities required social mechanisms unnecessary at earlier stages of evolutionary history. For example, neither amoebae (which reproduce by division) nor frogs (which leave their tadpole-offspring to fend for themselves) need the social instincts present in birds. At the same time as facilitating the raising of offspring, social instincts counterbalanced innate aggression. It became possible to distinguish between "them" and "us" and aim aggression towards individuals that did not belong to one's group. This behavior is clearly adaptive in the sense of ensuring the survival of one's family.

Second, with the development of intellectual faculties, human beings were able to reflect on past actions and their motives and thus approve or disapprove of others as well as themselves. This led to the development of a conscience which became "the supreme judge and monitor" of all actions (ibid. 235). Being influenced by utilitarianism, Darwin believed that the greatest-happiness principle will inevitably come to be regarded as a standard for right and wrong (ibid. 134) by social beings with highly evolved intellectual capacities and a conscience.

Based on these claims, can Darwin answer the two essential questions in ethics? First, how can we distinguish between good and evil? And second, why should we be good? If all his claims were true, they would indeed support answers to the above questions. Darwin's distinction between good and evil is identical with the distinction made by hedonistic utilitarians. Darwin accepts the greatest-happiness principle as a standard of right and wrong. Hence, an action can be judged as good if it improves the greatest happiness of the greatest number, by either increasing pleasure or decreasing pain. And the second question--why we should be good--does not pose itself for Darwin with the same urgency as it did, for instance, for Plato (Thrasymachus famously asked Socrates in the Republic why the strong, who are not in need of aid, should accept the Golden Rule as a directive for action). Darwin would say that humans are biologically inclined to be sympathetic, altruistic, and moral as this proved to be an advantage in the struggle for existence (ibid. 141).

b. Herbert Spencer

The next important contribution to evolutionary ethics was by Herbert Spencer (1820-1903), the most fervent defender of that theory and the creator of the theory of Social Darwinism. Spencer's theory can be summarized in three steps. As did Darwin, Spencer believed in the theory of hedonistic utilitarianism as proposed by Jeremy Bentham and John Stuart Mill. In his view, gaining pleasure and avoiding pain directs all human action. Hence, moral good can be equated with facilitating human pleasure. Second, pleasure can be achieved in two ways, first by satisfying self-regarding impulses and second by satisfying other-regarding impulses. This means that eating one's favorite food and giving food to others are both pleasurable experiences for humans. Third, mutual cooperation between humans is required to coordinate self- and other-regarding impulses, which is why humans develop principles of equity to bring altruistic and egoistic traits into balance (Fieser, 2001, 214).

However, Spencer did not become known for his theory of mutual cooperation. On the contrary, his account of Social Darwinism is contentious to date because it is mostly understood as "an apology for some of the most vile social systems that humankind has ever known," for instance German Nazism (Ruse, 1995: 228). In short, Spencer elevated alleged biological facts (struggle for existence, natural selection, survival of the fittest) to prescriptions for moral conduct (ibid. 225). For instance, he suggested that life is a struggle for human beings and that, in order for the best to survive, it is necessary to pursue a policy of non-aid for the weak: "to aid the bad in multiplying, is, in effect, the same as maliciously providing for our descendants a multitude of enemies" (Spencer, 1874: 346). Spencer's philosophy was widely popular, particularly in North America in the 19th century, but declined significantly in the 20th century.

Which answers could he give to the two essential questions in ethics? How can we distinguish between good and evil and why should we be good? Spencer's answer to question one is identical to Darwin’s (see above) as they both supported hedonistic utilitarianism. However, his answer to question two is interesting, if untenable. Spencer alleged that evolution equaled progress for the better (in the moral sense of the word) and that anything which supported evolutionary forces would therefore be good (Maxwell, 1984: 231). The reasoning behind this was that nature shows us what is good by moving towards it; and hence, "evolution is a process which, in itself, generates value" (Ruse, 1995: 231). If evolution advances the moral good, we ought to support it out of self-interest. Moral good was previously identified with universal human pleasure and happiness by Spencer. If the evolutionary process directs us towards this universal pleasure, we have an egoistic reason for being moral, namely that we want universal happiness. However, to equate development with moral progress for the better was a major value judgement which cannot be held without further evidence, and most evolutionary theorists have given up on the claim (Ruse, 1995: 233; Woolcock, 1999: 299). It also is subject to more conceptual objections, namely deriving "ought" from "is," and committing the naturalistic fallacy.

c. The Is-Ought Problem

The first philosopher who persistently argued that normative rules cannot be derived from empirical facts was David Hume (1711-1776) (1978: 469):

In every system of morality, which I have hitherto met with, I have always remark'd, that the author proceeds for some time in the ordinary way of reasoning, and establishes the being of a God or makes observations concerning human affairs; when of a sudden I am surpriz'd to find, that instead of the usual copulations of propositions, is, and is not, I meet with no proposition that is not connected with an ought, or an ought not. This change is imperceptible; but is, however, of the last consequence.

It is this unexplained, imperceptible change from "is" to "ought" which Hume deplores in moral systems. To say what is the case and to say what ought to be the case are two unrelated matters, according to him. On the one hand, empirical facts do not contain normative statements, otherwise they would not be purely empirical. On the other hand, if there are no normative elements in the facts, they cannot suddenly surface in the conclusions because a conclusion is only deductively valid if all necessary information is present in the premises.

How do Darwin and Spencer derive "ought" from "is"? Let us look at Darwin first, using an example which he could have supported.

  1. Child A is dying from starvation.
  2. The parents of child A are not in a position to feed their child.
  3. The parents of child A are very unhappy that their child is dying from starvation.
  4. Therefore, fellow humans ought morally to provide food for child A.

Darwin (1930: 234) writes that "happiness is an essential part of the general good." Therefore, those who want to be moral ought to promote happiness, and hence, in the above case, provide food. However, the imperceptible move from "is" to "ought" which Hume found in moral systems, is also present in this example. Thus, Darwin derives ought from is when he moves from the empirical fact of unhappiness to the normative claim of a duty to relieve unhappiness.

The same can be said for Spencer whose above argument about the survival of the fittest could be represented as follows:

  1. Natural selection will ensure the survival of the fittest.
  2. Person B is dying from starvation because he is ill, old, and poor.
  3. Therefore, fellow humans ought to morally avoid helping person B so that the survival of the fittest is guaranteed.

Even if both premises were shown to be true, it does not follow that we ought to morally support the survival of the fittest. An additional normative claim equating survival skills with moral goodness would be required to make the argument tenable. Again, this normative part of the argument is not included in the premises. Hence, Spencer also derives "ought" from "is." Thomas Huxley (1906: 80) objects to evolutionary ethics on these grounds when he writes:

The thief and the murderer follow nature just as much as the philantropist. Cosmic evolution may teach us how the good and the evil tendencies of man may have come about; but, in itself, it is incompetent to furnish any better reason why what we call good is preferable to what we call evil than we had before.

d. The Naturalistic Fallacy

But evolutionary ethics was not only attacked by those who supported Hume's claim that normative statements cannot be derived from empirical facts. A related argument against evolutionary ethics was voiced by British philosopher G.E. Moore (1873-1958). In 1903, he published a ground-breaking book, Principia Ethica, which created one of the most challenging problems for evolutionary ethics: the "naturalistic fallacy." According to Michael Ruse (1995), when dealing with evolutionary ethics, "it has been enough for the student to murmur the magical phrase 'naturalistic fallacy,' and then he or she can move on to the next question, confident of having gained full marks thus far on the exam" (p. 223). So, what is the naturalistic fallacy and why does it pose a problem for evolutionary ethics?

Moore was interested in the definition of "good" and particularly in whether the property good is simple or complex. Simple properties, according to Moore, are indefinable as they cannot be described further using more basic properties. Complex properties, on the other hand, can be defined by outlining their basic properties. Hence, "yellow" cannot be defined in terms of its constituent parts, whereas "colored" can be explained further as it consists of several individual colors.

"Good," according to Moore, is a simple property which cannot be described using more basic properties. Committing the naturalistic fallacy is attempting to define "good" with reference to other natural, i.e. empirically verifiable, properties. This understanding of "good" creates serious problems for both Darwin and Spencer. Following Bentham and Mill, both identify moral goodness with "pleasure." This means they commit the naturalistic fallacy as good and pleasant are not identical. In addition, Spencer identifies goodness with "highly evolved," committing the naturalistic fallacy again. (Both Moore's claim in itself as well as his criticism of evolutionary ethics can be attacked, but this would fall outside the scope of this entry.)

e. Sociobiology

Despite the continuing challenge of the naturalistic fallacy, evolutionary ethics has moved on with the advent of sociobiology. In 1948, at a conference in New York, scientists decided to initiate new interdisciplinary research between zoologists and sociologists. "Sociobiology" was the name given to the new discipline aiming to find universally valid regularities in the social behavior of animals and humans. Emphasis was put on the study of biological, i.e. non-cultural, behavior. The field did, however, not get off the ground until Edward Wilson published his Sociobiology: The New Synthesis in 1975. According to Wilson (1975: 4), "sociobiology is defined as the systematic study of the biological basis of all social behavior."

In Wilson's view, sociobiology makes philosophers, at least temporarily, redundant, when it comes to questions of ethics (see quote in introduction). He believes that ethics can be explained biologically when he writes (ibid. 3, emphasis added):

The hypothalamus and limbic system ... flood our consciousness with all the emotions - hate, love, guilt, fear, and others – that are consulted by ethical philosophers who wish to intuit the standards of good and evil. What, we are then compelled to ask, made the hypothalamus and the limbic system? They evolved by natural selection. That simple biological statement must be pursued to explain ethics.

Ethics, following this understanding, evolved under the pressure of natural selection. Sociability, altruism, cooperation, mutual aid, etc. are all explicable in terms of the biological roots of human social behavior. Moral conduct aided the long-term survival of the morally inclined species of humans. According to Wilson (ibid. 175), the prevalence of egoistic individuals will make a community vulnerable and ultimately lead to the extinction of the whole group. Mary Midgley agrees. In her view, egoism pays very badly in genetic terms, and a "consistently egoistic species would be either solitary or extinct" (Midgley, 1980: 94).

Wilson avoids the naturalistic fallacy in Sociobiology by not equating goodness with another natural property such as pleasantness, as Darwin did. This means that he does not give an answer to our first essential question in ethics. What is good? However, like Darwin he gives an answer to question two. Why should we be moral? Because we are genetically inclined to be moral. It is a heritage of earlier times when less morally inclined and more morally inclined species came under pressure from natural selection. Hence, we do not need divine revelation or strong will to be good; we are simply genetically wired to be good. The emphasis in this answer is not on the should, as it is not our free will which makes us decide to be good but our genetic heritage.

One of the main problems evolutionary ethics faces is that ethics is not a single field with a single quest. Instead, it can be separated into various areas, and evolutionary ethics might not be able to contribute to all of them. Let us therefore look at a possible classification for evolutionary ethics, which maps it on the field of traditional ethics, before concluding with possible criticisms.

2. Placement in Contemporary Ethical Theory

For philosophy students, ethics is usually divided into three areas: metaethics, normative ethical theory, and applied ethics. Metaethics looks for possible foundations of ethics. Are there any moral facts out there from which we can deduce our moral theories? Normative ethical theories suggest principles or sets of principles to distinguish morally good from morally bad actions. Applied ethics looks at particular moral issues, such as euthanasia or bribery.

However, this classification is not adequate to accommodate evolutionary ethics in its entirety. Instead, a different three-fold distinction of ethics seems appropriate: descriptive ethics, normative ethics, and metaethics. Descriptive ethics outlines ethical beliefs as held by various people and tries to explain why they are held. For instance, almost all human cultures believe that incest is morally wrong. This belief developed, it could be argued, because it provides a survival advantage to the group that entertains it. Normative ethical theories develop standards to judge which actions are good and which actions are bad. The standard as defended by evolutionary ethics would be something like "Actions that increase the long-term capacity of survival in evolutionary terms are good and actions that decrease this capacity are bad." However, the field has not yet established itself credibly in normative ethics. Consequentialism, deontology, virtue ethics, and social contracts still dominate debates. This is partly due to the excesses of Social Darwinism but also due to the unintuitive nature of the above or similar standards. Evolutionary ethics has been more successful in providing interesting answers in metaethics. Michael Ruse (1995: 250), for instance, argues that morality is a "collective illusion of the genes, bringing us all in.... We need to believe in morality, and so, thanks to our biology, we do believe in morality. There is no foundation "out there" beyond human nature."

Descriptive ethics seems, as yet, the most interesting area for evolutionary ethics, a topic particularly suitable for anthropological and sociological research. Which ethical beliefs do people hold and why? But in all three areas, challenges are to be faced.

3. Challenges for Evolutionary Ethics

The following are some lingering challenges for evolutionary ethics:

  • How can a trait that was developed under the pressure of natural selection explain moral actions that go far beyond reciprocal altruism or enlightened self-interest? How can, for instance, the action of Maximilian Kolbe be explained from a biological point of view? (Kolbe was a Polish priest who starved himself to death in a concentration camp to rescue a fellow prisoner.)
  • Could not human beings have moved beyond their biological roots and transcended their evolutionary origins, in which case they would be able to formulate goals in the pursuit of goodness, beauty, and truth that "have nothing to do directly with survival, and which may at times militate against survival?" (O'Hear, 1997: 203).
  • Morality is universal, whereas biologically useful altruism is particular favoring the family or the group over others. "Do not kill" does not only refer to one's own son, but also to the son of strangers. How can evolutionary ethics cope with universality?
  • Normative ethics aims to be action-guiding. How could humans ever judge an action to be ensuring long-term survival? (This is a practical rather than conceptual problem for evolutionary ethics.)
  • Hume's "is-ought" problem still remains a challenge for evolutionary ethics. How can one move from "is" (findings from the natural sciences, including biology and sociobiology) to "ought"?
  • Similarly, despite the length of time that has passed since the publication of Principia Ethica, the challenge of the "naturalistic fallacy" remains.

Evolutionary ethics is, on a philosopher's time-scale, a very new approach to ethics. Though interdisciplinary approaches between scientists and philosophers have the potential to generate important new ideas, evolutionary ethics still has a long way to go.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Darwin, Charles (1871, 1930) The Descent of Man, Watts & Co., London.
  • Fieser, James (2001) Moral Philosophy through the Ages, Mayfield Publishing Company, Mountain View California), Chapter 12 "Evolutionary Ethics."
  • Hume, David (1740, 1978) A Treatise of Human Nature, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Maxwell, Mary (1984) Human Evolution: A Philosophical Anthropology, Croom Helm, London.
  • Midgley, Mary (1980) Beast and Man: The Roots of Human Nature, Methuen, London.
  • O'Hear, Anthony (1997) Beyond Evolution: Human Nature and the Limits of Evolutionary Explanation, Clarendon Press, Oxford.
  • Ruse, Michael (1995) Evolutionary Naturalism, Routledge, London.
  • Spencer, Herbert (1874) The Study of Sociology, Williams & Norgate, London.
  • Wilson, Edward O. (1975) Sociobiology: The New Synthesis, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.
  • Woolcock, Peter G. (1999) "The Case Against Evolutionary Ethics Today," in: Maienschein, Jane and Ruse, Michael (eds) Biology and the Foundation of Ethics, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, pp. 276-306.

Author Information

Doris Schroeder
Lancaster University, United Kingdom

Ethics and Phenomenology

Phenomenology is, generally speaking, a discipline that examines questions of metaphysics and epistemology. Insofar as ethics is usually seen as a topic apart from metaphysics and epistemology, it is thus not typically addressed by philosophers in the phenomenological tradition. However, there are important areas of overlap between ethics, metaphysics and epistemology, which may be fruitful points of departure for exploring a phenomenologically-oriented notion of ethics. In particular, metaphysics and epistemology seek to consider the validity of, among other ideas, analysis and wonder. An exploration of analysis and wonder can reveal the importance of ethics in this context. Once we have seen what follows from this standpoint, further consideration of ethics in terms of engineering will show how this standpoint can inform upon the world of praxis.

Table of Contents

  1. Theoretical Concerns
    1. Ethics Underlies Wonder and Analysis
    2. War
    3. Hospitals
    4. Ethics of Integration
    5. People
  2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World
    1. Overview
    2. Human Factors Engineering
    3. Phenomenology: Brentano
    4. Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl
    5. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Parallels
    6. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Enter Ethics
    7. Ethics as Homological
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Theory
    2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

1. Theoretical Concerns

a. Ethics Underlies Wonder and Analysis

Ethics can be seen as the foundation of wonder and analytic thought. First, existentialists accept wonder and deemphasize analysis, though phenomenologists tend to be more open to wonder and analytic thinking. Logical positivists and linguistic analysts see wonder as reducible to logic. Existentialists and phenomenologists are comfortable with ethics associated with wonder and analysis. Positivists and analysts deny ethics as an irreducible field of study. Ethicists would look at wonder to see if people need drugs in order to achieve states of euphoria or peace. Additionally, ethicists would take the same view about computers and analytic method.

In both instances, the question of ethics enters concerning more than the validity of wonder and analysis in the traditional philosophical sense (Kazanjian, 80; Buber, p. 11). Traditionally, existentialists and phenomenologists see wonder as revealing what "is." Analysis has almost no place in much of existentialism, and varying degrees of validity in phenomenology. Traditionally, linguistic analysts and logical positivists see nothing to be gained with wonder. Reality is language, and is to be analyzed, never something about which to wonder.

Ethics brings in a deeper issue in both instances. Even if wonder alone is valid, ought people use drugs to feel a sense of awe? Even if analysis alone can give access to reality, ought people simply resot to computers, the higher the speed the better, to understand what is?

Existential and phenomenological thinkers tell us that awe or wonder is the basis of analysis, or as pure wonder, may stand alone without cognition. Ethicists may argue that awe or wonder is a human trait and ought not require or involve drugs and surgical stimulation of the brain to induce a sense of wonder (Campbell, p. 163). Awe is basically the social, intersubjective reality of living in the world. Phenomenology calls the world the lived world instead of just the material, quantifiable world. This wonder is consciousness in the unaltered state. In this unaltered state, wonder is part of normal, lived, reality or existence.

Ethicists would say that linguistic analysis or logical positivism changes or distorts reality. Drugs and brain stimulation are not lived reality. They develop a state of artificial awe or wonder. If the unaltered mind uses logic alone to access reality, it may mean altering reality from what ought be to what artificially exists. If the person uses mind altering drugs to achieve awe or wonder, then the awe or wonder itself is altered, artificial, and unlived. We then see not the lived world, but the artificial world.

Phenomenology says we should not excarnate or take analysis out of the lived world. Phenomenological ethicists would say we should not excarnate wonder itself from the lived world. Thus, phenomenologists and existentialists would be medically, pharmaceutically, or biologically excarnating wonder or awe from the lived world, even if they refute positivism and analytics' portrayal of awe or wonder as wrong and insist on wonder or awe as revealing reality. The ethical position becomes a sociological view (Bryant, p. 1).

Paul Ricoeur (p. 217) looks at Cartesian dualism and says that we must overcome its excarnating of objectivity from the body. Non-biochemically, Ricoeur is criticizing Cartesian dualism for ignoring the embodiment of the objective. He is insisting that objectification must be done within the context of the lived world. We analyze the lived world or reduce it to quantities within the general framework of awe or wonder. Ricoeur's approach suggests that even logical positivism and linguistic analysis needs to look at the problem of excarnation. These movements are in the same category as Cartesian dualism when they consider analysis or reduction as without wonder, or devoid of the lived world.

The difference between logical positivism and analytic philosophy on the one hand, and Cartesian dualism on the other, rests with their views of reality. Dualism sees mind and body, or objectivity and subjectivity, as both real and valid. The problem is how to relate them. Positivism and analytic thinking argue that the lived world, subjectivity, wonder, awe, and so on do not exist as irreducible reality. They are totally reducible to the simples of fact.

Ricoeurian thinking contrasts with Cartesian dualism and with positivism and analytic philosophy by saying all three movements should see themselves as having wrongly excarnated object from the lived world. An ethics approach to wonder, however, goes deeper than Ricoeur. The ethicist would insist that we cannot justify wonder for the sake of wonder. We need to look at how we approach wonder or awe. Saying that the lived world and wonder are important is not sufficient. Arguing against positivist and analytic reductionism of wonder to facts is only partly correct. How we define the biochemical context of wonder is critical.

In ethics, we may wonder by being conscious and not taking drugs to alter the brain. People look around them, or they inquire, or meditate, and feel it crucial to feel a sense of wonder that beings "are." We wonder by ourselves, without bio-physiological intervention. Indeed, we do not need to take an aspirin or other legal medication to feel as sense of relaxation, calm, or rest. Beyond this, ethics says we ought not feel it important or in any way justified to take any illegal drugs that might induce a "high." The biochemical high or awe is indeed a biochemical reduction or analytic approach to wonder. This approach would assume that the state of wonder is primarily, perhaps exclusively, a chemical reaction within the brain, and has little to do with normal, non-biochemical experiences of the lived world. In other words, the biochemical approach to wonder suggests that we wonder not through existing, but primarily through changing the chemistry of the brain.

Ethics might call the biochemical approach to wonder as biochemical, pharmaceutical, or otherwise physiological positivism or analysis. Ironically and unfortunately, this becomes serious to the point where no real inquiry, not even traditional logical positivism and analytic thinking is possible. An ethicist might ask us to look at a piece of analytic literature or philosophy. We see symbols, diagrams, and virtually mathematical methods for attempting to determine resolutions to questions and problems. The analytic thinker, the positivist, would argue that they are coming near to solving issues, and that these solutions or clarifications reveal a reality devoid of wonder.

The ethics approach notes that these analytic and positivist thinkers are consciously engaging in intellectually work. They converse with each other, perhaps argumentatively with existentialists and phenomenologists, but always are participating in some kind of control over what they are doing. Their brains are functioning without medication or alteration. Now, the ethicists will point out, consider the biochemically activated phenomenologist or existentialist. In other words, we no longer just speaking of the positivist and analytic thinker inquiring without drugs. We are no longer speaking of positivists and analytic thinkers trying to totally reduce wonder to facts in terms of normal, not medicated activity. What the ethicist criticizes is the phenomenologist or existentialist who is defending wonder through druges. This person is criticizing positivism and analysis for trying to totally non-biochemically reduce wonder or awe to atomism. Yet, the phenomenologist and existentialist is defending irreducibility by feeling wonder, perhaps even attempting writing if that is possible, by consuming biochemicals which will induce the sense of oneness or awe (Eliade, p. 31).

In effect, the phenomenologist or existentialist has become a de facto positivist or analytic thinker. The phenomenologist or existentialist becomes a biochemical phenomenologist or existentialist, totally reducing the chemistry of the brain, body, and lived world to atoms and chemical reactions. If it is possible, the ethicist calls this positivistic or analytic phenomenology or existentialism. On the other hand, for clarification, the ethicist might use another term: biochemical phenomenology or existentialism.

b. War

What of the analytic thinker or positivist using computers for their approaches? Ethics would point to the efforts by analytic thinkers during World War II to crack Hitler's Enigma Machine code. The machine worked strictly through symbols. Codes are symbols. During WWII the codes were relatively complex, but speed was crucial in breaking them. Today, and in the future, with cryptology becoming increasingly sophisticated, codes become more complex, and the speed required to break them more crucial.

Positivists and analysts would insist that their philosophy requires respect, and faster computers. Ethicists would argue that we need a better world where criminals and dictators are minimized, and their powers decapitated. Having the computer capabilities of speedier problem-solving does not "solve" the problem in its widest sense. The problem in its widest sense is that people, usually the leaders, go bad and make evil things happen in the world. When governments ignore the rise of evil, they usually invite international catastrophes such as the Second World War. As the war occurs, and as the innocent attempt to now fight and defeat the enemy, many on the side of the innocent take pride in their technical efforts.

Technical abilities helped our side win against Hitler in his efforts to communicate through codes. None of this would have had to occur if we had kept him from rising to power in the first place. His rise to power, and the unethical ways we ignored his ascension were key to the disaster of the Second World War. We ignored his actions against Jews and non-Jews. This ignorance was unethical. We sat back and did nothing.

Toward the end, we began panicking and wondered how to solve problems to end the war. One major answer was to break his coding abilities. Fortunately, we broke his code, and this helped us win the war.

Today, intelligence agencies are increasingly positivistic in their coding/decoding efforts. Computers are the foundations of coding/decoding. Speed is paramount. We spend money, lots of it, in developing ways of surreptitiously monitoring telecommunications to determine what potential terrorists are saying. Technology is advancing rapidly in our endeavors to translate foreign and English conversations to determine whether speakers are planning attacks.

Forgotten in all this rush to technologize existence, society ignores the ethical grounds of analysis and computers (Stine, 141). We forget that analysis is embodied in wonder, and that thinking and wonder involve the ethical orientation. Are we ignoring the poor, the economically and socially deprived, the underprivileged? We no doubt are ignoring the impoverished. Then, in the event that the impoverished seek ways of retaliating, we suddenly seeks technical ways of speedier discovery of the terrorists' plots.

Even when terrorists are wealthy, we seek to look the other way instead of considering their moral deviancy and their ongoing hatred of humanity, especially of the West. We let this hatred grow, assuming that we do not initially deny it. As their hatred grows, it can mushroom into attacks against the West or even people in other cultures. Only then, in post 9/11 fashion, do we react and seek the speediest computers to analyze terrorist activities and conversations.

Ethics is derived from ethos or people. Any human activity must be seen within the social context. Thinking and wonder are among the fundamental human activities. Relegating cognition to the sum total of data becomes anti-human; similarly, relegating wonder to the realm of intravenous or other methods of drug intake is no longer a human activity. The ethos orientation of cognition means that thought, contrary to what Descartes said, is embodied and of social perspective. Cognition is never disembodied. To disembody cognition is to commit two wrongs.

One wrong is to seek cognition as devoid of awe. This makes thought sterile and dehumanizing. The second wrong is to see disembodied cognition as part of a technology where speed is the only way to resolve problems and answer questions.

Awe or wonder is the pre-cognitive requisite of the cognitive. Yet, ethics notes that we cannot stop there. Wonder cannot be an end in itself. If wonder is derived from a natural, non-drug induced sequence whereby we simply wonder that things "are," then we are practicing true awe. Once we take drugs or otherwise stimulate the brain to induce wonder, than the wonder is unethical. It is mechanical rather than emerging from ethos.

c. Hospitals

Take the example of a hospital's intensive care unit. Patients are put on a respirator to help them breathe. They may also be put on intravenous feeding so that the body can be "fed" nutrients mechanically instead of taking in food through the mouth. In time, however, society believes that such patients may be retained on such mechanical devices only if their physical conditions warrant such technologization. The purpose of life is for the patient to be helped toward normalcy. In this case, the patient must be helped to leave the hospital and eat and breathe, and so on, on their own.

The objective of life, of the hospital, is never to merely have the patients remain in intensive care, or even in the hospital. People need to be active in daily life, eating, breathing, and so on on their own. To eat and breathe on their own means dining and respiring as part of society, with one's own bodily abilities. Food is irreducible to nutrients. Breathing is irreducible to oxygen intake. Food and respiration emerge from the ethos, from the ethical. As biological as eating and breathing, they are not merely physical processes.

For example, the nervous person, the seriously emotionally troubled individual, will have difficulty eating and breathing. Human activity such as eating and breathing are as much part of the ethos or ethical, as they are physical, neurochemical, and so on. Indeed, eating disorders such as those resulting in being overweight, imply reducing food to merely physical entities being "put into the mouth." Eating does not mean simply stuffing the mouth, eating quickly, or any other physical process. Dining is a cultural, ethical process.

Similarly, we do not just respire by hyperventilating. We breathe by inhaling and exhaling normally, often unconsciously. Perons inhaling too fast may be suffering from an emotional problem, or perhaps physical difficulty. Persons inhaling and exhaling too fast are behaving unethically, anti-ethos or different from normal human activity.

We can say the same about wonder and analysis. Wonder is something we sense under normal human conditions without mechanical assistance. Drugs ought not play part of wonder.

Analysis is an activity in which we participate without the aid of computers, and hopefully within the context of wonder. To think analytically is to take apart. But to spend our time only taking apart means that we are simply assuming that words, pictures, behavior, and so on are only to be taken apart and never appreciated as products of the ethos or community. Taking apart ought mean that something was initially a whole. That wholeness cannot be violated. If we emphasize the taking apart aspect of existence, and reject or ignore the synthetic and the wonderful, we have relegated existence to a form of hospitalization, to a form of the intensive care unit.

Existence is not meant to be only analyzed, and it is not meant to be only wondered. Ethos means that analysis and wonder go hand in hand. Analysis and wonder are not mutually exclusive. We never merely analyze without some wonder, and never wonder by merely mechanical means. Both analysis and wonder reflect an ethical, social, cultural dimension.

Feminism can be helpful here. Feminists argue that nothing written is ever totally objective, and devoid of the cultural. Look at books. Their authors are not just "authorities," but traditionally have been white males. Their subject matter, too, have typically ignored injustices toward women. Sexism means that we have looked at women simply as reducible to anatomy, and never as human beings. Ethics means that women are human beings, irreducible to physical characteristics.

Racial theory can also help. Racism has meant that authorities writing books have been white males. But the ethical thrust of the women's’ movement and racial justice has attempted to bring about a better, ethos oriented vision. We now have books and articles written by women, and by nonwhite males. Authors are not just authors. They are a racial-gender-human continuum. No author is the sum total of racial, religious, biological, and other parts. Every author is first of all a human being.

Wonder and analysis, then, are irreducible to mechanical identification. Persons need to be able to wonder with only their mind and body, in awe of the universe or of any particular event. They need only to analyze within the context of this natural wonder, and with computers only on a limited scale.

Ethics does not demand the exclusion of computers from society. The ethos orientation requires only that computing, speed, technology, and other quantification occur within the context of a healthy environment. The idea of proactivity or prevention is important here.

Proactivity means we need to prevent rather than react to bad events. Before illness strikes, we need to monitor physical and other conditions resulting in disease. Ethics means we ought not ignore health dangers, and then react medically, physically, surgically, to "solve" unhealthy situations. Drugs, whether over the counter or prescription, do not need to take the place of a healthy lifestyle and diet. People might need to depend on drugs as they age and their body deteriorates. Even then, they must take drugs only by doctor's orders, and never simply because the drugs are there.

The preventative, proactive approach to health includes habits of proper diet, exercise, monitoring stress, wearing clothes appropriate to the season, air conditioning during the summer and heat during the winter. These measures and lifestyles help insure that people will not get ill to the extent that they can have some reasonable control over life. Illness can and will come under many circumstances. Viruses, bacteria, many forms of sickness will emerge regardless of what we do to prevent illness.

When illness does come, we need to take a look at the best ways of curing what we have, and returning to a relative healthy state. Physicians may often examine patients and tell them than rest, proper diet, the drinking of fluids, and so on, will probably help bring the patients back to health. Not all diseases require medication. Additionally not all diseases require surgery. Even broken bones may not require cutting the patient. In time, many bones will heal correctly if their break is not in a physical position to cause deformity when healed.

Medicine, then, often seeks to prevent illness through a healthy lifestyle. When medical treatment is needed, pills are often preferable to surgery. Similar approaches are sought by ethicists for awe and analysis.

Wonder and analytic thinking are never mutually exclusive. Existence does not consist of wonder devoid of analysis, or analysis and rational-sensory approaches lacking awe. Most importantly, phenomenological ethics means that wonder and analysis are not to be merely the ends in themselves. We cannot say that because we are analyzing within the context of wonder, we are therefore being ethical, appropriately intellectual and properly in awe.

The states of awe and analysis are human states. They are irreducible to mechanical, physical, neurophysiological methods. Before we consider being in awe as a context for being analytical, we need to realize the need for being ethical, social, humane. Ethics is more than doing right and avoiding wrong in daily activity, business ventures, and the professions. Ethical behavior is basic to cognitive efforts to understand reality. The drug culture of the 1960s assumed that achieving a "high" was very important, but could not be reached until persons smoked pot or did hard drugs to alter the mind.

Similarly, people who believe in the rational approach to existence frequently misinterpret rationalism, logic, calculation, and speed. They too often assume that the logical or rational sequences are only sequences depending on speed. Their view is that speed is fundamental, and therefore the faster a sequence the better. From that view, the quicker we gather and understand greater numbers of variables or parts of the problem, the better our solution.

An unethical view of problem solving involves quick technical solutions to a given problem. A problem can be small or large. Instead of asking ourselves whether the problem is real or not, we frequently tell ourselves that speedy solutions are the answer. For example, take urban crime. We see robbers, burglars, car thieves. We hear of homicides and arsonists. Our typical approach is to assume that crime is crime, and its solution is a nonsocial, purely professional response from the police. The more police the better. The faster our calls are answered, and the quicker the police arrive at the scene, the better we feel that the problem of criminality is being solved.

This unethical view says that more crime we have, the more and faster police response we need. That view also suggests that the faster we get fingerprints and identify the wrongdoer, the more our society is progressing. Our emphasis is on speed, imprisonment or worse, technology, and other mechanical forms of reaction.

The ethical approach is fundamentally different. We would give opportunities to young people in order to attract them to productive lives outside crime. Families need strengthening, discipline must be practiced and taught, neighborhoods aware of wrongdoing, parental responsibility required. Our social institutions must be upheld. Churches, social groups, schools, governmental organizations, hospitals, and all businesses will need to work together. The police are there, but cannot be the only people combating crime. Technology ought be there, but only within the context of the social structures.

Society ought not ignore the social conditions and then go after the criminals arising as a result of deteriorating cultural situations. Culture is the not only contributor to crime. Some people simply may be born trouble makers. A weak social structure lets them do as they please until it is too late. Simply waiting for people to become criminals, then going after them, arresting, taking them to trail, and locking them up are the mechanical ways of recidivism.

The ethical approach attempt to return the criminal to society through rehabilitation when initial parenting or habilitation has failed. We cannot just let young people grow up doing as they please, and then throw the book at them when they go wrong. Society seems to like the mechanical approach to most things. In medicine and health, we increase emergency rooms. In law enforcement, we want more and faster police. Education becomes a mechanical method of learning from computers. Transportation develops into a way of speedier, aircraft, and automobiles even if we need to build bigger airports, and destroy ecology with more highways. Information becomes merely a commodity where we transmit data and receive it with greater efficiency. In more and areas, technology and rapidity of getting something or someone from here to there becomes paramount. Ethically, medicine must involve better health habits, law enforcement better homes, love, and discipline, learning a matter of student teacher interaction, travel a matter of bicycles and trains, and information an issue of understanding and social empathy.

d. Ethics of Integration

Wonder and analysis are good when they are integrated. We cannot have just wonder, or only analysis. Yet, integrated or not, wonder must come from within and never as a result of drugs and electrical stimulation of the brain. Analysis must be within the social context and never merely a computerized battle toward solutions. Phenomenological ethics shows awe to be the view that things are fundamentally one, and culturally uplifting. Basic to all is our wonder that reality is a beautiful, awesome, non-problematic existence.

Existence is more than just a problem to be solved, a difficulty to be overcome. Existing ought mean appreciating life, people, God, culture, and all plants and animals. We cannot just look at the world as an ongoing defect to be repaired. Life may have evil in it, but is not essentially evil. It is a wondrous reality. This view is available to us not just through drugs, but our very natural feeling of awe. Again, good parenting and better social structure can contribute to or take away from this feeling.

Albert Einstein displayed ethics when he told his fellow scholars at Princeton to stop by an say hello from time to time. Most scholars were shocked. They felt that Princeton was a place for intellectual discourse instead of chit chat and normal conversation. They felt even more strongly that Einstein's work was so critical that they did not wish to interfere in his studies with what they consider small talk or any conversation irrelevant to scientific work.

We think of Einstein as a scientist. He was clearly displaying what phenomenology calls intersubjectivity and wonder as the basis of any scientific work. Einstein believed that normal human beings, even those in intensive scholarly research, needed and should engage in the wonder of interpersonal, face to face community that this the social foundations of any verbal communications. Community is the basis of communications. We cannot communicate or convey information from person to person unless we first establish of acknowledge what phenomenology calls the "given" community or lived world.

e. People

In phenomenological ethics, we are first, last, and always in the community of people, in intersubjectivity, wonder, awe, or the non-cognitive. We are one with vegetation, with nature, with spiritual powers or religious dimensions. The term "people like us" is not to be taken as meaning individuals of our race, creed, color, or gender. It is to be interpreted as meaning that all human beings in the world are like each other. People are the same, regardless of race, creed, and so on.

Wonder means that all things are essentially related with each other. We do not first sense races, creeds, religions, and genders, and then arrive, step by step, to our humanity. The first thing we sense is that all individuals are alike. Races, religions, and so on are differentiations that we tend to make in distinguishing each other. Wonder makes it clear that whatever else we have as differences, human beings are, at bottom, the same.

Only within the context of fundamental awe of the unity of all things, do we then take apart or analyze people from each other, animals, nature, and so on. Analysis, done within awe, is benign. Analysis done outside the framework of wonder becomes mere taking apart of the essentially unified. In this sense, analysis becomes mere destruction.

Wonder and analysis in the ethical perspective comprise our intersubjective, sensory, rational unity. This occurs only when awe and analytic thinking occur within the context of the ethic or ethos: culture. Human beings are meant to awe that they are in the unified world of people, animals, vegetation and nature. Nothing is or ought be totally objectified. We are meant also to differentiate or analyze carefully in order to understand and intellectually cope with the existing world. Within awe, we objectify in order to develop an intellectual stance about why things are as they are.

Intersubjectivity and objectivity go hand in hand. Intersubjectivity or wonder devoid of objectivity becomes dangerously anti-technology. Objectivity alone becomes anti-human. Ethics tells us that this integration is complete when we appreciate intersubjectivity through normal human activity and not through drugs. We need also appreciate objectivity through normal intellectual activity and never through seeing speed, technology, or quantification as an end in itself.

The awe of our being together as a basis for any technique in analyzing that intersubjectivity can be seen MIT's OpenCourseWare. Classroom learning with face to face interaction is fundamental to any distance learning. Wonder occurs not through mechanical activity but the social interaction found in the classroom; analysis is then found not through sophisticated telecourses, but computers existing and operating in the service and context of face-to-face interaction.

Alfred North Whitehead (p. 232) says that philosophy begins in wonder, and that wonder continues after philosophers have analyzed reality. Judith Boss says ethics begins in wonder. Philosophy can say that wonder and analysis begin with ethics, and that ethics continues as the context or orientation for analysis and wonder, and all activity.

2. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

a. Overview

A key model that represents the way to tie phenomenological ethics to the world is by examining ethics, philosophy, and engineering. Scholars in the field of ethics would say that their field provides basic ideas unifying engineering and philosophy. Those thinkers who are ethicists would indicate that engineering and philosophy share a common ground in ethics. Engineering and philosophy are specific manifestation of ethics. The ethicist's position sees engineering and philosophy as fields where human beings and values orient technology, objectivity, reason, and logic.

Ethicists (Kazanjian, 1998, Chapter 2) would view ethics as unifying engineering and philosophy. Scholars in ethics would view their field as underlying the humanistic thinking in philosophy, and the scientific views of engineering. Those who study ethics would see ethical ideas as necessary in courses in virtually all disciplines and professions. These scholars see ethics as an interdisciplinary foundation to the arts and sciences. For ethicists, business ethics, legal ethics, medical and biomedical ethics, engineering ethics, are all integral parts of business, law, medicine, and the other disciplines. Those who are ethics scholars would say business ought engage in ethical instead of unethical practices. These ethicists would also see lawyers, physicians, biomedical researchers, engineers, and others as competent when their curriculum teaches them values and morals as well as technical expertise. Ethicists would say that values and morals orient technique. The ethical perspective sees the mechanics of a given field as ethically oriented. Ethics scholars would view any disciplinarian as a professional concerned with human beings instead of merely a cognitive or technical, non-ethical expert. Scholars from the field of ethics see their work as interdisciplinarity, among their tasks being the disclosure of the ethical basis of engineering and philosophy. As such, ethicists see their discipline as basic to liberal arts and sciences, and interdisciplinarity at any level.

b. Human Factors Engineering

Human factors engineering, also known as ergonomics or ergonomic engineering, is that kind of engineering which designs physical environments including machines and processes to match human limits and abilities, and train people to use those environments (Chapanis, p.534; Kantowicz and Sorkin, p. 20). These engineers work with mathematics, physics, chemistry, and often computers. Beyond these scientific and technical fields, ergonomics engineers deal with human beings. These engineers are concerned not only with how to design an environment, but how to design it to be safe for the user.

The ergonomics position sees safety as meaning that engineers ought design the environments to be user friendly and ought avoid both user unfriendly and user too friendly designs (Adams, p. 256). A design that is user unfriendly ignores the user. To be user unfriendly means is a design whereby the machine or process is dangerous or offensive for the user. The other design is user too friendly, whereby the machine or process is so safe as to be rendered unfunctional. Designing something as user friendly means that users are able to work with an environment which takes into account the users' limits and abilities. Such limits and abilities mean people have arms, legs, eyes, ears, and torsos with certain anatomic and sensory measurements. Arms bend in certain ways and are of certain lengths. The same with legs. Ears hear best at certain sound levels. We see best at certain distances.

Ergonomics is saying that human beings see, hear, and move within certain physical parameters. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on. Any machine or process ought be designed such that it allows the user to use it comfortably, without undue stress or tension. Designing user friendly machines or processes is right. Designing an environment that forces people to merely sense or move is wrong. At the other extreme, designing an environment so safe that users need not make any effort to learn or use it is also wrong. The system could become nonfunctional.

The typical human factors engineering text looks like a combination engineering, psychology, and biology book. Ergonomics engineers say that any physical environment is as much social and psychological as it is mathematical, physical, or chemical. No user friendly design is totally reducible to the sum of nuts and bolts. Human factors argues that objects and people comprise an interface: both are interrelated to each other. Machines/processes and human beings ought not be seen as mutually exclusive, but inherently human-oriented. Al Gini (p. 3) argues that work is vital to our identity, but it must be a humanizing career and never just meaningless, dehumanizing sum of tasks.

Human factors also rejects overemphasizing the user. If machines/processes are to take into account the user's abilities and limits, they are not to simply make things so safe and user-friendly that the machine/procedure becomes unfunctional or unable to perform its technical task.

c. Phenomenology: Brentano

Phenomenology is the philosophical movement somewhere between existentialism and logical positivism. Existentialists would see human beings or any aspect of reality almost totally irreducible to numbers or rational explanation, while the logical positivist position would view people and any reality as totally reducible to number and reason. The existential position views our social and cultural embodiment or existence is almost completely irreducible to number and reason, whereas logical positivism and linguistic analysis see our existence as basically, perhaps totally, rational and numeric. Brentano is considered the founder of phenomenology. He (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8) initiated the idea of intentionality. Intentionality means that consciousness or embodiment inherently relates to objects. Consciousness is consciousness of objects. Brentano attempted to overcome the logical positivist notion that objects and sensation are real, and consciousness is totally reducible to objectivity.

Brentano would see the thinking mind and the body mutually interrelated . He believed Cartesian dualism is wrong in stating that thinking and the body are two different entities. In speaking about the mind-body unity, Brentano set the stage for Husserl to develop phenomenology. Brentano spoke of the mind-body continuum and rejected total objectivity. Thinking is continuous or interrelated with the body. But Husserl more fully developed the continuum and rejecting two extremes: thinking alone or objectivism, and mere embodiment or subjectivism.

d. Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl

Edmund Husserl moved beyond Brentano (Stewart and Mickunas, p. 8). Husserl sees a development of the mind-body continuum. Objectivity or mind is never value-free or disembodied, according to Husserl. All objectivity is value-laden or occurs as worldly, social, cultural. This view contrasts with the logical positivist notion that objectivity is the sole reality, and value-free.

Husserl's position would say objectivity ought be seen as reflecting or matching subjectivity or values. From the perspective of phenomenology, we must consider all phenomena as real that appear to consciousness or our thoughts. Where logical positivists and linguistic analysts, and all emotional terms such as God as poetry and not cognitively meaningful, phenomenologists believe all objectivity reflects subjectivity, culture, values, and ethics.

The phenomenological position sees the mind-body issue in the manner that people ought look at physical environments as continuous with subjectivity, and emotions and noncognitive ideas as the social milieu generating the meaning of physical environments. Phenomenologically, objects, cognition, and cultural artifacts are real: products of human or subjective intentions. Mathematics, physics, chemistry, computers, and all the arts and sciences must be seen as part of life. But these cognitive realities emerge from a social, subjective realm and are not to be divorced from human experience. Cognition is never reducible to numbers, symbols, sense perception, and other non-emotive reality. Words reflect human experiences as a whole.

The position of phenomenology is that objectivity to be value-laden and ought avoid two extremes. One extreme is value-free cognition. This is cognition whereby cognition or any object is seen as free of any emotive or cultural values or spirituality. The other extreme means extreme existentialism that rejects any reducibility. Here, science, technology and any cognitive effort is considered almost anti-human. Phenomenology sees cognition and physical environments as things that take into account our values and any other noncognitive being. People have cognitive and analytical abilities and ought use them in certain ways. Knowing is not a simple matter of sense perception and analysis. The blanket denial of the reality of noncognitive ideas such as God and values suggests too simplistic a means of getting at reality.

Husserl also rejects subjectivism or solipsism. In saying that everything appearing to consciousness is real, critics argues that he was dangerous near, if not in fact, advocating solipsism. However, Husserl reject both logical positivism's cold objectivism, which says people are objects and values unreal, and extreme existentialism and subjectivism's solipsism, which maintains that the self is the only reality.

Phenomenology: Alfred Schutz (p. 140) comes from the perspective of applied phenomenology. Specifically, his viewpoint is sociology. He considers sociology as the study of "lived history," or human institutions within which we find chronological or day to day history. He points out that human beings see, hear, and move within value parameters. Social structures comprise "lived history," and are the context within which "chronological history" makes sense. Schutz ideas are similar to those of Kenneth Boulding. Boulding, while not technically a phenomenologist, notes that perception and action occur within our images of wholes, and never as the sensing of raw data or merely mechanical anatomic movement. People do not merely perceive, sense, move, and so on.

In phenomenology, consciousness intends or is consciousness of objects, thus revealing a subject-object continuum. Objectivity, perception and movement, in turn, are colored by our values and lived world. Objectivity is continuous with subjectivity. Subjectivity is never the reality of just one person, but intersubjective or social. Thus, phenomenology rejects the existential notion of extreme individuality or the virtually solipsistic ego.

Reality, in phenomenology, is the subject-object continuum or duality. Phenomenologists say we ought avoid Cartesian dualism of the mutually exclusive mind and body. Consciousness is always of the object, and the object is always embodied. Ricoeur (p. 217) argues that phenomenology overcomes Cartesian dualism by reintroducing the excarnate mind into the carnate or body. His efforts enable phenomenology to resolve dualism, as well as the objectivism of positivism, and subjectivism of existentialism.

The mind-body continuum means that subjectivity and objectivity are both real, but comprise a systematic reality instead of parts being real in themselves. Human beings exist in a world of physical reality. We sense this as we consider the lived world of culture giving meaning to material objects and generating ideas. Subjectivity does not exist alone; it requires a object. Likewise, objectivity is not merely "out there;" it is always perceived within cultural, lived orientations.

The phenomenological view is that subjectivity is never devoid of objectivity, while the solipsistic position entails subjectivity as devoid of objectivity. We need the world, for people are part of physical reality. Interpreting objectivity as devoid of subjectivity is similarly wrong. It becomes a dehumanized objectivity disregarding human beings and consciousness. Along these lines and seemingly less serious a problem, dualism is just as wrong, according to phenomenology. Objects and subjects are irreducible to mutual distinct, inherently unrelated entities. We do not just take discreet objectivity and subjectivity and externally juxtapose them. We would be unable to bridge the subject-object gap if it were intrinsically discontinuous or unbridged.

e. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Parallels

Human factors engineering and phenomenology appear to be mutually distinct fields. One is engineering and quantitative, the other a philosophical movement rejecting total quantification. As such, engineering and phenomenology would seem to be irreconcilable disciplines: engineering being strictly hard culture, phenomenology fundamentally soft culture. But our brief statements above show something else.

A glance at human factors engineering and phenomenology reveals parallels. Human factors believes that all physical environment interface with people. Objects ought be designed as continuous with human operators. The entire system is a machine-person interface or continuum, instead of the machine being something totally objective and non-personal. Phenomenology says that mind or objectification is continuous with the social dimension. Phenomenologists speak of the mind-body continuum. Human factors could speak of the machine-user continuum, phenomenology of the mind-body interface. Human factors would be saying machines are continuous with the user, phenomenology would be indicating that the mind interrelates with the body. In ergonomics, seeing designs or actual machines means seeing the operator or subjectivity. In phenomenology, seeing words on paper must mean seeing human values and other intangibles. For human factors engineers, machines/processes ought be acknowledged as intrinsically continuous or interfacing with people's physical, social, and psychological limits. In phenomenology, the written word ought be recognized as inherently continuous with values and other cultural themes underlying the empirical.

Human factors says machines/processes ought be user-friendly, and ought not be user-unfriendly. Phenomenology maintains that objectivity ought be seen as value-laden, and never value-free. By user friendly, human factors means buttons, numbers, levers, lights, and other physical apparatus the operations and reasons of which the user can learn relatively easily, and the use of which will not harm the person. The human being need not be the proverbial rocket scientist to understand these operations; training would not require the typical user to earn a Ph.D., or even take one course from MIT. The user also need not be made of steel or physically qualify for Navy SEAL commando work to use the environment. The user friendly environment is designed for the typical person's intellectual and physical abilities. By value-laden, phenomenology means any word ultimately reflects human values. No word is or can be value-free, as the philosophical movements logical positivism and .linguistic analysis tend to maintain. Positivists and analytic thinkers argue that words such as God, love, and religion do not belong in intellectual discourse because they reflect values and emotion. Words such as chair, table, atom and other words are value-free and non-emotive. However, chair reflects the English language, can imply the electric chair, can mean a department head at a college or university, and appears to be nonsexist relative to the apparently sexist term chairman. Phenomenologists would maintain that no word is value-free, that every term is a sociology of that term. Every word emerges from and reflects the social and cultural framework that produces it.

A user unfriendly environment is totally objective, ignoring human limits and abilities and forcing people to mere push, pull, and perceive. Al Gini (p. 120) notes that work offering no hope and becoming unethical is wrong, and means roughly what ergonomics means by user unfriendly work. Value-free language would mean a totally objective set of words over which there is no debate. However, every math, computer, physics and other science book or piece of literature reflects a human author and the author's perspective, slant, or view. Feminism and civil rights thinkers have shown that such books (any book) are value-laden whether we like it or not. Each is written by a white male, black male, Latino woman, or person of a particular religious, ethnic, or sexual orientation. An author lacking ethnic, gender, and similar human qualities is impossible.

Human factors could say machines ought be user-laden, while phenomenologists might indicate that objectivity ought be seen as subject-friendly. The human factors term "user" is synonymous with phenomenology's term “subject.” User and subject mean the human being and the cultural context from which the human being emerges.

Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at human-made environments as reflecting culture and not as just cognitive, scientific, or merely objective fields of study and work. Moreover, both ergonomics and phenomenology consider the human as part of the object. Thus, ergonomics notes that we ought avoid simply catering to the person's every desire and want, and phenomenology rejects solipsism's view that the individual is the sole reality.

f. Phenomenology and Ergonomics: Enter Ethics

The previous section notes the technical parallels between ergonomics and phenomenology. Readers will see the term "ought" throughout the paragraphs.

Phenomenology and human factors have fundamental parallels, as indicated in the previous section. These are intellectual or technical similarities. They indicate that both see a unity of objects and people.

In doing so, they are ethical in the general sense. Both machines and rational thought emerge from the social context. Ergonomics argues that machines reflect the social and cultural milieu, and are not totally reducible to nuts and bolts. Phenomenologists (Stewart and Mikunas, p. 10) note that God, love, anger, desire, and other intangibles are real because they appear to consciousness. Secular phenomenologists consider nonreligious themes as real. Religious phenomenologists believe that theological and spiritual notions such as God are real.

Both human factors experts and phenomenologists deny that sensation is our only way of knowing and experiencing. Ergonomics engineers would say it is wrong or unethical to design a machine or process that has operators simply "look," “hear,” or otherwise sense a control panel or other part of a machine. Phenomenologists argue that we would be outside the ethos or culture if we considers human behavior or reality as strictly sensory phenomena.

Engineers abide by and study professional ethics, and the Occupational Safety and Health Administration monitors dangerous in the workplace according to federal law. Phenomenology, however, does not become part of a professional ethics issue except in the case of the ethics of teaching. It may seem that in phenomenology, the subject-object discontinuity or dichotomy is only an academic rather than a technically ethical matter as in engineering. To say that objects are disconnected from and do not reflect subjectivity is not an ethical matter.

Phenomenology is concerned with ethics in the broad sense of ethos or culture. Totally reducing knowledge or reality to the empirical means excarnating or taking sensation out of the social realm comprising ethos. In applied phenomenology, reducing people to computerized forms, numbers, and related paper work may be seen an unethical or socially undesirable.

In acknowledging the social and psychological as well as physical side of people, both human factors engineering and phenomenology are rooted in the sociology of human-made products. A sociology of work suggests that people do not just "do." They do and know within social, ethos, and thereby ethical constraints.

Both human factors engineering and phenomenology share the view that the person or subject is not alone. In ergonomics, machines ought take the user into account, but this does not mean that the design reflect everything about the user. Physical environments should not be so designed as to satisfy every want, desire, and whim of the operator. Operators need to be trained, and put forth effort to realize that the environment requires change on the users' part. Additionally, operators are continuous with their surroundings. They are not Luddites, working or existing alone, without the use of physical environments. Phenomenology says that subjectivity is not the same as subjectivism. In subjectivism, the self is considered to be alone, devoid of objectivity.

Phenomenology seems not to fall into the same ethics category of including punishments for unethical behavior as does human factors engineering. However, the culture that supports a totally dehumanized attitude toward people, such as allowing computerization to go wild and reduce everyone to numbers in every instance, is manifesting an anti phenomenological view. The positivism attitude is that we merely know and are excarnated from feelings and emotions. No ethical ruling can be made against positivism as an intellectual movement Yet positivism reflects the culture view that we can and ought ignore feeling and other intangibles.

The lived world is phenomenology's notion that people live, work, and play in a social context where not everything is totally reducible to numbers or is effable. Paul Ricouer tells us that Cartesian dualism is the effort to see the world and the mind as two different substances. The Cartesian world-view means that cognition is excarnate, discontinuous with the body. Positivism argues that the cognitive is all there exists. Ricoeur would want us to reintroduce the cognitive into the lived world, and to see cognition as incarnate or embodied.

Broadly speaking, the embodied viewpoint is the ethos-oriented viewpoint whereby cognitive activity emerges from the parameters of culture. People ought not just think. Basically, they never just think. Thus, no individual ought take the stand that we are simply thinking substances, whether this substance is somehow related to the body in dualistic terms, or stands by itself in positivistic notions. On the other hand, the cognitive is part of life. We ought not consider the reductive or cognitive as unwarranted, as in much existentialism. We certainly ought not take the view that the cognitive does not have a reality, that the self is alone, that each of us is isolated.

The ethical view posits a holistic perspective. Objectification ought be seen as interfacing or being continuous with the subject or intersubjectivity. Neither objectification devoid of subjectivity, nor subjectivity without objectivity, is the ought.

Human factors speaks of groups of users, not just a user, as reference for designing machines. Phenomenology speaks of intersubjectivity, not just of one subject, a reference for seeing the cognitive. Both ergonomics and phenomenology look at individuals as social, and their limits and abilities are pertaining to groups rather than to one or two people.

Phenomenological thinkers take the position that could be interpreted as the philosophical version of ergonomics. In ergonomics, we do not hear of linguistic analysis, logical positivism , or existentialism. Yet, Ergonomics reveals or deals with language in the broadest sense. When ergonomics speaks of people seeing, hearing, touching, pulling, they are using language. In saying that a person is something that simply sees, hears, etc., we are being positivistic and reducing the individual to an object. If we agree that users are human beings who see, hear, and otherwise sense and move within emotive, cultural, and physical contexts, we are then thinking or using language from a phenomenological viewpoint.

Traditional linguistic analysis tends to imply that philosophers in that vein are only thinkers and not fundamentally akin the engineering. An interdisciplinary attitude with a broad vision of language sees things differently. Language analysts in philosophy work with symbolic logic and not technical mathematics. Human factors engineers work with mathematics, but are suggesting that people are indeed at least partly physical, sensory, and material. Ergonomics may be called human factors, but it can also be called subjectivity factors: we need to take the subjective and cultural into account for engineering processes.

As a corollary, the phenomenological position would be that human factors considers users as not mere objects, but that any characteristic of the person that appears to consciousness is a valid reality. Thus, engineers who are only nuts and bolts people traditionally say we are only skin, neurons, senses, and bones. This is very positivistic language. Phenomenologically, users are also values, emotions, spirituality, and ethos as a whole. Human factors and phenomenology are looking at operators as fundamentally human beings with dignity and essentially irreducible qualities.

Logical positivists might argue that their members helped win World War II by cracking Hitler's Enigma Machine code. This is true. On the more fundamental side, Hitler would not have risen to the powerful level that we allowed to him to do so had we been phenomenological and cultural. As he was rising and accumulating power, a cultural view would have told us to stop him in his tracks. Had we done so, war would have been unnecessary, the Normandy invasion would not have had to occur, and Hitlers codes would not have had time to develop to be used against us.

Ethics tells us that human factors and phenomenology speak the same language, though ergonomics is the trained engineer designing machines, and phenomenologists are philosophers trained in inquiry and argument instead of the design of physical environments. Physical environments are but a form of language. Ergonomics and phenomenology speak the same language in terms of acknowledging that objectivity is subject- or value-oriented. Al Gini speaks of work in terms of business ethics: work must be ethical and never unethical.

They speak the same language in saying that human beings are essential social instead of standing alone. The physical, written, and motor environments are never totally reducible to objects "out there." But as reflections of human beings, these environments mirror "our" and not “my” world. Any human value represents the share world-view of numerous individuals comprising a group. Language ought never be either completely symbolic as in the totally logical methods of linguistic analysis, nor ought it be simply one person's language which no other person can understand.

Two people, one a human factors engineer, the other a phenomenologist, can look at a machine or consider a procedure. These two individuals can communicate with each other if they understand their shared viewpoint. Both are coming from the ethical perspective. The engineer is saying that the numbers, words, and motions, which is to say, the language, of a system, ought reflect human beings in light of culture. A phenomenologist is saying that the writings in a human factors text ought reflect the social, psychological and related value-oriented words and meanings we see in culture.

Both the ergonomics and phenomenological philosopher would agree that the human values comprise a share enterprised that reflects the objective world continuous with the cultural milieu. No person is an island, no person is reducible to flesh and bones. Somewhere between extreme individualism and mere objectivism, the subject-object continuum or machine-person interface comprises a reality including the validity of external and internal worlds.

Ethics means objects are the externalizing of human ideas and the validity of the outside world. As ethos, we are neither extra-ethos nor merely ethos. The extra-ethos or extra-ethical suggests that people are sensations and motions; the merely ethos or ethical can mean we are only a commune, only a community doing little or nothing. Pushed to the extreme, the commune leads to the individual member as possibly believing that he or she stands alone.

In both human factors and phenomenology, language as our fundamental nature is seen as an object-subjective reality. Positivism sees language as symbols and sensory activity; traditional engineering involving merely nuts and bolts sees machines, and therefore language, as the sum total of physical parts. Human factors and phenomenology, rooted in ethos, consider language as a holistic reality whereby being serves to objectify itself through beings.

g. Ethics as Homological

We typically think of ethics as a course of study, as in professional or philosophical ethics. In that way, ethics is no more fundamental than any other discipline. The above pages show that ethics is isomorphic or homological. Isomorphic is derived from iso meaning the same, and morphic meaning shape. Ethics is the same shape or principle that underlies ergonomics and phenomenology. Homological is derived from homo means same, and logic meaning word or structure. Ethics is the same structure from which ergonomics and phenomenology are derived. Learning ethics is basic to human factors engineering and phenomenology. As we consider ethics, we find it necessary to objectify within the parameters of culture, values, and perhaps spirituality. From the engineering perspective, ethics becomes a method of developing physical structures for human use. From the philosophical view, ethics can be interpreted as the intellectual inquiry into knowledge and reality.

As an isomorphic or homological root to human factors and phenomenology, ethics becomes the foundations for a liberal arts. Whatever we know and do, we are inherently facing the opportunity to know and do what is humane, and what is not. This opportunity means intellectual and engineering approaches are basically ethical. They emerge from culture or ethos. To deny values would be to reject our cultural foundations; to seek only values would be unrealistic.

Interdisciplinary research has gone in two directions. One is interdisciplinarity in the sense of team teaching and putting together courses and topics in some sort of seamless or minimally seamed fabric. Ethics plays an equity role here. It is one of the disciplines or ideas relevant to knowledge. The other direction (Kazanjian, 2002, p. 30) is more fundamental. This is the isomorphic direction. Isomorphic or homological ethics means that we must study ethics as a cultural, ethos framework within which we find the roots for all other professions.

Ethics as the homological root of numerous disciplines can thereby show us how to understand human factors engineering and phenomenology. Take ethics away from ergonomics and we essentially eliminate human factors engineering. The very term "human factor" implies that ethos is basic to engineering. Take ethics away from phenomenology and we basically have logical positivism. The subjective orientations of objectivity refer to the ethos from which emerges the objective.

Contemporary interest in professional ethics implies that ethical and non-ethical thinking and doing is something new. Indeed, our admission is new. The existence of the ethical perspective is as old as humanity. Mircea Eliade (p. 31) has taken pains to elucidate the validity of ethics in primitive cultures. In every society we have dos and don'ts. Without that view, any person in any culture will simply do or know, and the result could hurt that person or others.

Eliade's point concerns comparative religion. Ancient societies did everything by repeating the anatomic gestures as performed in Primordial Time by the gods. Primordial Time is the time before the gods created the world and our idea of calendar time. No member of any society simply "did" something. Today, we imply that we merely do or know. Even Eliade suggests that contemporary society is totally secularized. Yet, Clifton Bryant's research in the sociology of work (p. 1) catalogues the social and thus ethical directions of knowledge and technique.

Ethics, then, is not just another topic (Kazanjian, p. 3). It is the ongoing insight that ethos or culture provides us with the framework for survival and etiquette. Human factors and phenomenology are two specific manifestation of that insight.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Theory

  • Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Social Dimensions of Work Englewood Cliffs, NJ.: Prentice-Hall; 1972
  • Martin Buber I and Thou New York: Charles Scribner's Sons; 1970.
  • Jeremy Campbell The Improbable Machine New York: Simon and Schuster; 1989,
  • Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion Cleveland: The World Publishing Company; 1958.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
  • Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary Evanston, IL: NorthwesternUniversity Press; 1968.
  • David Stewart and Algis Mackunas Exploring Phenomenology Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
  • G. Harry Stine The Hopeful Future New York: Macmillan;1983.
  • Alfred North Whitehead Modes of Thought New York: The Macmillan Company; 1958.

b. Tying Phenomenological Ethics to the World

  • Jack A. Adams Human Factors Engineering. New York: Macmillan; 1989.
  • Mircea Eliade Patterns in Comparative Religion. Cleveland, OH: World Publishing; 1963.
  • Clifton D. Bryant ed. The Sociology of Work. Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice Hall; 1972.
  • Alphonse Chapanis, "Human Engineering," in Operations Research and Systems Engineering ed. Charles D. Flagle, William H. Huggins, and Robert R. Roy, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press; 1960.
  • Al Gini My Job, My Self. New York: Routledge; 2001.
  • Edmund Husserl Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to PhenomenologicalPhilosophy The Netherlands: Kluwer; 1967..
  • Barry H. Kantowicz and Robert D. Sorkin. Human Factors. New York: John Wiley; 1983.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Phenomenology and Education The Netherlands: Rodopi: 1998.
    • Especially chapters one and two comparing ethics, human factors, and phenomenology.
  • Michael M. Kazanjian Learning Values Lifelong The Netherlands: Rodopi; 2002.
  • Algis Mikunas and David Stewart Exploring Phenomenology. Athens, OH: Ohio University Press; 1990.
  • Paul Ricoeur Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary. Evanston: Northwestern University Press; 1966.
  • Alfred Schutz The Phenomenology of the Social World. Evanston: Northwestern University Press;1967.

Author Information

Michael M. Kazanjian
U. S. A.

Embodied Cognition

Embodied Cognition is a growing research program in cognitive science that emphasizes the formative role the environment plays in the development of cognitive processes. The general theory contends that cognitive processes develop when a tightly coupled system emerges from real-time, goal-directed interactions between organisms and their environment; the nature of these interactions influences the formation and further specifies the nature of the developing cognitive capacities. Since embodied accounts of cognition have been formulated in a variety of different ways in each of the sub-fields comprising cognitive science (that is, developmental psychology, artificial life/robotics, linguistics, and philosophy of mind), a rich interdisciplinary research program continues to emerge. Yet, all of these different conceptions do maintain that one necessary condition for cognition is embodiment, where the basic notion of embodiment is broadly understood as the unique way an organism’s sensorimotor capacities enable it to successfully interact with its environmental niche. In addition, all of the different formulations of the general embodied cognition thesis share a common goal of developing cognitive explanations that capture the manner in which mind, body, and world mutually interact and influence one another to promote an organism’s adaptive success.

Table of Contents

  1. Motivation for the Movement
  2. General Characteristics of Embodied Cognition
    1. Primacy of Goal-Directed Actions Occurring In Real-Time
      1. Developmental Psychology
      2. Robotics/Artificial Life
    2. Form of Embodiment Constrains Kinds of Cognitive Processes
    3. Cognition is Constructive
  3. Embodied Cognition vs. Classicism/Cognitivism
  4. Philosophical Implications of the Embodied Cognition Research Program
    1. The Compatibilist Approach
    2. The Purist Approach
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Motivation for the Movement

Although ideas applied in the embodied cognition research program can be traced back to the seminal works of Heidegger, Piaget, Vygotsky, Merleau-Ponty, and Dewey, the current thesis can be seen as a direct response and, in some cases, a proposed alternative to the cognitivist/classicist view of the mind, which conceptualizes cognitive functions in terms of a computer metaphor. The cognitivist/classicist research program can be defined as a rule-based, information-processing model of cognition that 1) characterizes problem-solving in terms of inputs and outputs, 2) assumes the existence of symbolic, encoded representations which enable the system to devise a solution by means of computation, and 3) maintains that cognition can be understood by focusing primarily on an organism's internal cognitive processes (that is, specifically those involving computation and representation). Although this research program is still prevalent, a number of problems have been raised about its viability, including the symbol-grounding problem (Searle 1980, Harnad 1990), the frame problem, the common-sense problem (Horgan and Tienson 1989), and the rule-described/expertise problem (Dreyfus 1992).

Embodied cognition theorists view cognitivist/classicist accounts as problematic for many reasons, but they are especially concerned that these accounts result in an isolationist assumption that attempts to understand cognition by focusing almost exclusively on an organism's internal cognitive processes. Specifically, the concern is that if an isolationist assumption rests at the heart of the cognitivist/classicist research program, then the resulting explanations are inaccurate because they either underplay or completely overlook environmental factors that are essential to the formation of an accurate explanation of cognitive development. Consequently, this isolationist assumption is perceived to result in decreased explanatory power since it de-emphasizes two crucial factors that are needed to understand cognitive development: 1) the exact way organisms are embodied, and 2) the manner in which this embodied form simultaneously constrains and prescribes certain interactions within the environment. In its place, embodied cognition theorists favor a relational analysis that views the organism, the action it performs, and the environment in which it performs it as inextricably linked. Yet, before one can fully appreciate why embodied cognition theorists favor a relational over an isolationist analysis, it is necessary to discuss the theoretical assumptions that comprise the general embodied cognition framework.

2. General Characteristics of Embodied Cognition

Since the present embodied cognition research program is in its early stages, the general approach does not yet have hard and fast tenets that are agreed upon by all embodied cognition theorists. Consequently, this program is rather fluid, in that even the central researchers are striving to understand further exactly what is meant by embodied cognition. Yet, this should not prevent the characterization of the common assumptions found in most embodied cognition theories. The goal of this section is to highlight some of the most common theoretical assumptions shared by embodied accounts of cognition. The viewing of these assumptions together will provide a clearer picture of what embodied cognition roughly entails as a research program.

Once again, the central claim of embodied cognition is that an organism's sensorimotor capacities, body and environment not only play an important role in cognition, but the manner in which these elements interact enables particular cognitive capacities to develop and determines the precise nature of those capacities. Developmental psychologist Esther Thelen (2001) further clarifies the central claim of this research program in the following passage:

To say that cognition is embodied means that it arises from bodily interactions with the world. From this point of view, cognition depends on the kinds of experiences that come from having a body with particular perceptual and motor capacities that are inseparably linked and that together form the matrix within which memory, emotion, language, and all other aspects of life are meshed. The contemporary notion of embodied cognition stands in contrast to the prevailing cognitivist stance which sees the mind as a device to manipulate symbols and is thus concerned with the formal rules and processes by which the symbols appropriately represent the world (xx).

Although embodied cognition accounts vary significantly across disciplines in terms of the specific ways in which they attempt to apply the general theory, a few common theoretical assumptions can be found in just about any embodied view one examines. These further theoretical assumptions help to flesh out the central thesis, and include 1) the primacy of goal-directed actions occurring in real-time; 2) the belief that the form of embodiment determines the type of cognition; and 3) the view that cognition is constructive. Each theoretical assumption will be explained by considering the work of a theorist whose research exemplifies the particular theoretical assumption under investigation. The first theoretical assumption, the primacy of goal-directed actions occurring in real time, is explained by considering research in robotics/artificial life and developmental psychology.

a. Primacy of Goal-Directed Actions Occurring In Real-Time

Embodied cognition theorists contend that thought results from an organism's ability to act in its environment. More precisely, what this means is that as an organism learns to control its own movements and perform certain actions, it develops an understanding of its own basic perceptual and motor-based abilities, which serve as an essential first step toward acquiring more complex cognitive processes, such as language. Thus, goal-directed actions are described as primary for embodied theorists because these theorists argue that thought and language would not occur without the initial performance of these actions. In essence these low-level actions and movements are viewed as necessary for higher cognitive capacities to develop. In order to consider evidence in support of this initial theoretical assumption, one need only turn to the research of developmental psychologists Esther Thelen and Linda Smith (Thelen and Smith 1994, Thelen 1995). By briefly summarizing one of their numerous experiments on infant development, we can consider why many embodied cognition theorists characterize Thelen and Smith’s research as some of the most influential and convincing developmental evidence in support of this assumption that "thought grows from action and that activity is the engine of change" (Thelen 1995: 69). This discussion will highlight why the primacy of actions unfolding in real time is one of the defining theoretical assumptions of embodied accounts of cognition.

i. Developmental Psychology

In order to understand how infants learn to reach, Thelen and Smith (1994) examined four different infants from the time the babies were 3 weeks old until they were 1 year old. What Thelen and Smith conclude is that each of the four infants faced unique problems in learning to reach based on their individual energy level, body mass and the different ways in which they initially tried to reach (that is, their pre-reaching behaviors). Given these different pre-reaching movements, each of the infants had to learn a different set of strategies for controlling their arms so that the ultimate solution was specifically tailored to address the unique problem the particular infant was encountering. Thus, each infant was eventually able to overcome these developmental obstacles and learn to reach the toys, but the specific ways in which they learned this behavior varied depending upon the specific problem they were encountering. To understand how these different reaching problems translated into unique reaching solutions, let's consider two of the infants whose reaching approaches varied considerably: Gabriel and Hannah.

Thelen and Smith describe Gabriel as an extremely active infant who was initially unable to successfully reach the toy because he would excitedly flap his arms, in seemingly random movements that were not focused enough to enable him to obtain the toy. Consequently, he had to learn to control these energetic movements so that this energy would become more focused. By learning to control these excited movements, he would then be able to produce a more controlled reaching-action that would propel his hand to the desired location. Gabriel eventually learned to reach toys after multiple unsuccessful attempts; however, these unsuccessful reaching attempts were instrumental in helping him realize how to adjust his muscle patterns so that a successful reaching pattern finally emerged that enabled him to focus his energy in the direction of the toy.

In contrast to Gabriel's need to control wildly energetic movements, Hannah encountered quite the opposite problem. Unlike Gabriel, Hannah is described as "a quiet, contemplative infant who was visually alert and socially responsive, but motorically less active" (Thelen and Smith 1994: 259). Consequently, she did not encounter control problems, but suffered from the inability to generate enough force to overcome gravitational forces and propel her arm forward. Like Gabriel, Hannah learned to exert the proper amount of force needed to successfully reach an object through trial and error. However, her initial reaches were closer to an adult pattern than Gabriel’s because her slow movements enabled her to have more control over where her hand would encounter the toy. Thelen and Smith (1994) conclude that:

Hannah's problem was different from Gabriel’s, but it was also the same. She, like Gabriel, had to adjust the energy of forces moving her arm—in her case to make her arm sufficiently stiff or forceful to lift it off her lap. What Gabriel and Hannah had in common, therefore, was the ability to modulate the forces they delivered to the arms to change their ongoing, but non-functional patterns to movements that brought their hands close enough to the toys for them to make contact. Their solutions were discovered in relation to their own situations, carved out of their individual landscapes, and not pre-figured by a synergy known ahead by the brain or the genes (260).

The importance of Thelen and Smith's research becomes clear when we contrast their conclusions with the manner in which change is explained in other leading developmental theories. Thelen notes that in other theories change is explained by appealing to "some deus ex machina—’the genes,’ 'maturation of the brain,’ ‘a shift into a new stage,’ or ‘an increase in information-processing capacity’" (Thelen 1995: 91). Such moves are problematic, Thelen argues since they merely push the level of explanation back a step so that in order to fully understand how change occurs this new theoretical mechanism must also be explained. Moreover, Thelen notes that the unique problems encountered and solved by individual infants make it extremely unlikely that the solutions were innate, since no internal mechanism could know in advance the specific “energy parameters of the system” (Thelen 1995: 90).

In contrast to these ungrounded attempts at explanation, Thelen and Smith claim to provide a theoretically-grounded, emergent conception of change by explaining change in terms of a dynamical systems framework, in which the challenge is "to understand how the system can generate its own change, through its own activity, and within its own continuing dynamics, be it the spring-like attractors of the limbs or the neural dynamics of the brain" (Thelen 1995: 91).

One advantage of a dynamic systems analysis is that it can account for how different infants must learn unique pre-reaching strategies based on their specific energy level, body mass and the different ways in which they initially tried to reach (that is, their pre-reaching behaviors). Yet, despite these different techniques, Thelen and Smith's account still identifies the common factors that all of the infants had to learn to control: the various forces surrounding arm control, such as gravitational resistance. By developing a dynamical systems analysis of reaching behavior, Thelen and Smith provide a theoretical mechanism that tries to explain the exact way in which these different forces interact. The resulting analysis tracks how activity brings about changes in the system, so that new types of behavior emerge from behaviors the system already knows. This means of generating new patterns from those that already exist results in 'environmental scaffolding’, since a new behavior is generated from the current resources of the system. Moreover, this dynamic systems analysis enables the researcher to track how the different movements/actions change and evolve over time. Consequently, behaviors, such as reaching, are explained in terms of interactive forces, which are mathematically understood since they are grounded in the physics of action.

One possible objection to a dynamic systems analysis of development is that this research program is limited because it will only be able to account for low-level, goal-directed action (that is, walking, reaching, etc.). Although this in itself would be a step forward, the ultimate goal is to also explain the diachronic emergence of higher-level cognitive abilities. Thus, in order to even have a chance at explaining cognitive complexity, a dynamical systems approach must bridge the gap between explaining how individuals acquire new lower-order activity patterns and explaining how they acquire higher order activity patterns, such as learning to categorize. In answer to this concern, Thelen argues that the infant's ability to gain control over its body in order to perform various activities enables the infant to simultaneously learn certain categories. More specifically, the infant learns "that a certain category of force dynamics is appropriate for a certain class of tasks" (Thelen 1995: 95). For instance, infants learn that objects in front of them can be fun to play with. Therefore, these infants work to remember the ways in which they must change their muscle patterns in order to manipulate forces, which enables them to reach the object. Consequently, after a certain number of experiences with particular perceptual events (e.g., the toy in front of them), infants begin to recognize that action oriented solutions to these events are also generalizable (e.g., class of reaching toy behaviors). It is in this way that infants begin to associate particular patterns of force with particular events in the world. Thelen further explains that:

These early movements often look to be entirely without form or meaning. But if what neuroscientists tell us about the plasticity of the brain and how it changes is correct, infants are also continually learning something about the perceptual-motor systems and their relations to the world in their repeated spontaneous activity. That is, what infants sense and what they feel in their ordinary looking and moving are teaching their brains about their bodies and about their worlds. They are in fact exploring what range of forces delivered to their muscles get their arms in particular places and then learning from their exploration, remembering how certain categories of forces get their hands forward toward some-thing interesting (90).

Consequently, infants must learn how to perform certain activity patterns, such as reaching, and then remember when it is appropriate to generate those patterns again to achieve a desired goal. In order to effectively perform these behaviors at the appropriate times, the infant must learn to categorize particular situations and correctly apply the action solution that corresponds with that situation. For example, if a baby learns how to control its arm muscles so that it can reach a toy it desires, then it will not take long for the infant to realize that the same type of reaching behavior can also be used to grasp food. It is in this sense that the behaviors become generalized as the infant learns to use its body to explore its environment. Moreover, one might argue that the generalized categories formulated to perform these reaching behaviors could be viewed as one instance of intentional categorization emerging from action of a dynamical system.

Next, an examination of research conducted in the growing field of robotics/artificial life will further clarify why the primacy of action occurring in real time is a defining theoretical assumption that guides research in all areas of embodied cognition.

ii. Robotics/Artificial Life

Until recently, almost all of the robots built in the field of artificial intelligence were constructed according to the stored-description model. Building systems, according to the stored-description technique, requires programmers to guess at the conditions the robot will encounter, and then to spell out all of the relevant information that is needed for the system to generate an appropriate response in its environment. Determining what information to include in the system is difficult, since the programmer must anticipate everything the robot will need to know to perform its task as well as providing the robot a response to any unexpected environmental features that might throw it off task. This process of explicitly stating all of the necessary information is further complicated by the fact that the system does not start with any prior knowledge, or even a simplistic understanding of the kinds of things existing in the world. So, even if all of the relevant information is correctly represented in the system, there are still no guarantees the robot will correctly perform its task, since it must then determine what makes a piece of information relevant in one situation and not in another. Given these challenges, robots utilizing the stored description model are very brittle and tend to malfunction in environments when they encounter unexpected events, or multiple soft constraints.

In the early 1980's, MIT roboticist Rodney Brooks became dissatisfied with the stored-description approach as well as with the general direction of artificial intelligence research. Although systems were being built that could play chess and calculate taxes, behaviors commonly associated with higher cognitive functions, Brooks argued that little progress was being made on developing systems that could quickly perform simple environmental tasks. After all, if one of the goals of robotics is to simulate how human cognitive processes work, then constructing robots only according to the stored description approach becomes problematic if these robots cannot adapt and change with their environment; abilities attributed to even simpler organisms, like insects. Therefore, Brooks decided to try to build a robot that could thrive in an environment without utilizing a central planning facility; the result was Herbert.

Herbert was designed to wander around the MIT lab disposing of empty soda cans. Although Herbert's task might seem relatively simple, to accomplish it successfully he had to perform a number sub-tasks; including identifying empty soda cans from full ones, avoiding the stationary tables and chairs in his path, and maneuvering around the seldom-stationary people who also inhabit the lab. In order to efficiently accomplish his task of can removal, Herbert relied on what Brook’s called a "subsumption architecture," which consisted of a number of connected layers, each responsible for performing a specific task; actions emerged from the suppression or activation of various sub-systems. As Herbert moved through his environment, he continuously encountered stimuli, which dictated which layer was activated at any given time. For instance, once Herbert’s object-detection layer successfully detected a wall obstructing its path, it activated the object-avoidance layer, which shut down the layer responsible for forward motion. The various connected layers plus the environmental stimuli ultimately determine the suppression or activation of a particular layer. Brooks argued that the subsumption architecture enables Herbert to “use the world as its own best representation” since Herbert does not need to refer to a detailed map of his surroundings before determining how to react. Instead, in systems such as Herbert, an effective interface is continually recreated between the system and the world without relying on a central planning facility to dictate commands, or encoding classicist representations.

Brook's subsumption architecture provided an alternative to the stored-description architecture by demonstrating that a robot could quickly react in its environment without the aid of a formal plan. From a design perspective, this development was an important accomplishment since a smart tradeoff was achieved; a fast reaction time was gained by developing sub-systems/layers that generated behaviors that reacted to types of phenomena (that is, avoiding walls in general) instead of tokens (that is, avoiding wall #3). Since Herbert’s task could be successfully executed without needing to re-identify one wall from the next, Herbert’s wall avoidance layer reacts to every wall in the same manner—by avoiding it. Consequently, knowledge of tokens was traded for knowledge of types in a manner that promoted speed.

In summary, Brooks' research in artificial life, as well as the research of many other roboticists (see also Mataric 1992, Agre and Chapman 1997, Tilden 1999, Mataric, Clancey 1997), helps to clarify the first theoretical assumption of embodied cognition: the primacy of goal-directed action occurring in real time. One reason that Brooks’ research is an excellent example of this theoretical assumption is his emphasis on developing robots that employ quick, cost-effective solutions to "everyday" problems encountered in an environment. Although much more progress needs to occur in Artificial Life before architectures are developed that are capable of explaining behaviors associated with higher cognitive processes, these early architectures are still able to do something the classicist/cognitivist systems have not: provide a preliminary attempt at modeling some of the simple, low-level behaviors that are necessary for survival.

In addition, the earlier examination of Thelen and Smith's research provides us with another example of why embodied cognition accounts maintain that action occurring in real time is the essential to understanding cognitive development. Specifically, a dynamic systems analysis is capable of tracking the way in which behaviors evolve and unfold over time; this real-time analysis is completely missing from current classicist/cognitivist accounts of developmental change.

b. Form of Embodiment Constrains Kinds of Cognitive Processes

The next theoretical assumption to which most embodied cognition theorists ascribe is the belief that the embodiment of an organism simultaneously limits and prescribes the types of cognitive processes that are available to it. In other words, the particular way in which an organism is embodied (e.g., whether it has feet, fins, eyes, a tail, etc.) will influence how it performs goal-directed actions in the world, and the particular sensorimotor experiences connected with these actions will serve as the basis for category and concept formation.

To illustrate this point, consider how two very different organisms, a child and a puppy, will try to play with a ball. If the child wishes to get the ball, she will most likely use her hands, but she could also use her feet. Yet, she will not normally use her mouth to get the ball, even if the size of the ball does not preclude this option. This is because, aside from being culturally frowned upon, the other options enable greater control, are easier to perform, and are culturally sanctioned. However, a puppy has fewer options, and will most likely grab the ball with its mouth, since its particular form of embodiment will not enable it to grasp the ball with its paws. Although there are further differences related to how the child and puppy can perceive and interact with the ball, including the fact that the child's visual system will include color cues, while the dog’s visual system will only enable it to see the ball in black and white, the important point is that, in each case, the way the organism is embodied constrains the options available to it.

A further point is that each of these different types of interactions (that is, grabbing with one's hands, clutching with one’s mouth, pouncing with one’s paws, etc.) has its own set of corresponding sensorimotor experiences, which directly influence how the organism interacts with the object. This is because the continuous feedback from these sensorimotor experiences serves as the basis for how the organism understands a specific interaction. Moreover, since activities always take place in a specific environmental context, such as when a child plays soccer with a friend on a spring day, the sensorimotor driven understanding of the situation that is gained from performing the activity in these circumstances can further inform how the organism might carry out future attempts at performing the same activity.

In general, environmental factors are very important because they can influence not only what options are available to a particular organism, but also why an organism might choose one option over another when performing a particular goal-directed activity. For instance, weather conditions, the size of the ball, the rules of the game, and whether or not an individual has any broken limbs will most likely factor into their decision to throw the ball, or kick it. Yet, all of this person's past experiences with an object in these varied activity-based contexts will in some way contribute to their current understanding of the activity. The individual’s understanding of these past experiences is directly informed by the kinds of sensorimotor experiences their form of embodiment allows.

The various sensorimotor experiences that occur while performing an action in a particular environmental context further specify the type of categories/concepts the organism is capable of forming. For instance, it is common for a small child to have a basic understanding of concepts related to macroscopic objects, such as grass, that are likely to exist in her immediate environment, while having little to no real understanding of concepts related to microscopic objects, such as bacteria, that might be found in the same environment. It is not surprising that the child gains an understanding of the macroscopic first, because these objects are the ones that she can see, taste, feel, hear, and smell unaided. In other words, she has sensorimotor experiences that are directly linked to the macroscopic objects in her environment, and these experiences serve as the foundation for concept formation. Not surprisingly, direct experience of microscopic entities will most likely occur later in the child's life, when she is introduced to tools, such as a microscope, that will enable the detection of these entities. The child can also acquire indirect knowledge of microscopic entities if the explanation is cast in terms of those things that she already does understand, namely entities found on the macroscopic level.

In conclusion, the way in which we are embodied determines the type of action patterns we can perform and these action patterns shape our cognitive functions (that is, the way in which we can conceptualize and categorize). This is because most embodied cognition theorists argue that category and concept formation is made possible and constrained by the particular sensorimotor experiences of the organism. It is in this sense that the form of embodiment partly determines the kind of cognitive processes available to the organism. Psychologists, such as Barsalou (1983, 1997), Glenberg (1997,1999), and Thelen and Smith (1994), are but a few of the cognitive scientists who adopt this theoretical assumption even though the specific content of their individual views varies. For instance, Glenberg (1997) illustrates how cognition results from embodiment due to'mesh,' which refers to the particular way in which affordances, knowledge, and goals combine. Yet, Barsalou (1997) develops a theory of simulation, and as demonstrated earlier, Thelen and Smith (1994) explain the emergence of this theoretical assumption according to a dynamical systems framework. Thus, all of these individuals agree with the theoretical assumption that the form of embodiment partly determines the cognitive processes available to the organism, but they still debate precisely how this occurs.

c. Cognition is Constructive

If the way we conceptualize and categorize is based on the way we are embodied, then according to embodied cognition theorists these concepts and categories are actively constructed and not merely apprehended wholesale from an observer-independent environment. The point here is that the way in which we are embodied not only constrains the way we can interact in the world, but our particular form of embodiment also partly determines the way the world appears to us. In effect, it does not follow from the existence of an observer-independent world that this world is seen in the same manner by all organisms. Instead, the claim is that certain environmental features are re-constructed depending upon a number of relevant factors, including the task at hand (that is, the goal-oriented action being performed), the functioning sensorimotor modalities, the vantage point of the organism, the form of embodiment, etc. The basic idea is that the organism actively constructs a sensorimotor representation that is based on those environmental features that are directly relevant to the goal-directed action it is currently performing. Consequently, environmental space X could be viewed differently by the same organism depending on the type of task the organism is performing in that space, primarily because the goal-directed activity determines which environmental features are relevant to the successful performance of the activity. For instance, individuals attend to different features when they are preparing to mow a stretch of grass with a lawn mover, than when they are playing soccer on it later the same day. This is because the environmental features one must observe to successfully mow the lawn are different from those that impact playing soccer well.

In direct contrast to viewing cognition as actively constructed from select environmental features, the cognitivist/classicist assumption is that the world has a set of pre-given features that are passively retrieved from the environment through representations that mirror the world; the way the organism is built and its particular goal-directed actions are not viewed as integral to the cognitivist/classicist analysis. Yet, embodied cognition theorists question the evolutionary viability of viewing cognition as passive retrieval; they maintain it is too time-consuming and unnecessary for organisms to formulate representations that completely mirror environmental features that are unrelated to the goal-directed activity the organism is currently performing. In response, the classicist/cognitivist might argue that a more serious problem results if you do claim that the embodiment of an organism determines how it will view the world; the very existence of an observer-independent world is called into question if an organism's understanding of the world is constructed.

The embodied cognition theorist might respond that the classicist/cognitivist has misinterpreted what it means to claim that cognition is a constructive process. By constructive, Embodied theorists do not mean to imply that there is no objective, external reality and that everything is subjective. Instead, the point is that a type of mutual specification occurs between the organism and its environment, so that the way the world looks and the way in which the organism can interact in the world is primarily determined by the way the organism is embodied. So, an observer-independent world can be granted, but embodied cognition theorists claim that an organism will understand this world in terms of the unique sensorimotor relations it experiences. These fundamental sensorimotor experiences achieved through acting in the world are actively constructed to facilitate concept formation. For instance, we view our bodies as having distinct fronts and backs. Due to the characteristics we associate with each of these bodily spatial relations, linguist George Lakoff and philosopher Mark Johnson (1999) argue that we also characterize objects in the world according to these assignments (that is, go to the front of the house, that is the back of her shirt, etc.). This process is considered to be constructive because we project these characteristics onto the world because they reflect the foundational understanding we have of our own bodies.

Consequently, if we were embodied differently then we would not see the world in this particular way, but in terms of our new set of defining bodily characteristics. However, by taking into account the bodies that we do have, our actual projected spatial assignments can be traced back to sensorimotor experience, which enables the formation of spatial schemas that are projected onto a scene to facilitate reasoning without the use of deductive logic. These schemas are constructive because they do not mirror what exists in the world. Instead, these schemas structure elements within the world in such a way that the individuals can understand their environment quickly. Given this, it should not be surprising that one way for an organism to interpret its environment is in terms of something it already knows well: its own bodily interactions.

A number of arguments in support of the constructive nature of cognition are also offered In The Embodied Mind, in which cognitive scientist Francisco Varela, philosopher Evan Thompson and psychologist Eleanor Rosch argue at length that color "provides a paradigm of a cognitive domain that is neither pre-given nor represented but rather experiential and enacted" (1991:171). Specifically, Varela, Thompson, and Rosch maintain that our ability to see colors results from the active interplay of various sensorimotor modalities. The interconnected way in which these different sensorimotor modalities mutually affect one another is clearly demonstrated in the case of the colorblind painter; a neurological case study from which Varela et al are not merely arguing that color is constructive as a result of the visual system, but they are making the stronger claim that “color perception partakes of both other visual and sensory modalities” (164).

In this case study, a painter (hereafter Mr. I) who completely lost his ability to see colors after a car accident finds that this loss directly affected the way he experienced other sensorimotor experiences, such as taste and sound. As a result of his accident, he was only able to see the world in varying degrees of black, white and gray. Moreover, Mr. I was not able to imagine colors, dream in colors, or remember what colors looked like. Since he was no longer viewing the world as colored in any of these ways, Mr. I reported that the nature of his experience of the world was also affected dramatically. Reportedly, everything around him "had a distasteful, 'dirty' look, the whites glaring, yet discolored and off white, the black cavernous-everything wrong, unnatural, stained, and impure." Due to this abrupt change in the way he was viewing his environment, he stated that he was no longer able to have sex or enjoy food. Moreover, Mr. I was not able to enjoy music to the degree he had before the accident since he was no longer able to visually transform musical notes into color sequences.

After living with this condition for some time, Mr. I remarked that while he was initially upset about his inability to perceive color, he now no longer misses it. In fact, he reported that his actions, tastes and behaviors have naturally adjusted over time to reflect that of a night person. He stated that "I love the night time….I often wonder about people who work at night. They never see the sunlight. They prefer it....It's a different world: there’s a lot of space—you’re not hemmed in by streets, people….It’s a whole new world. Gradually I am becoming a night person. At one time I felt kindly toward color, very happy about it….Now I don’t even know it exists—it’s not even a phantom" (164). Varela et al. concluded that:

This description provides rare insight into how our perceived world, which we usually take for granted, is constituted through complex and delicate patterns of sensorimotor activity. Our colored world is brought forth by complex processes of structural coupling. When these processes are altered, some forms of behavior are no longer possible. One's behavior changes as one learns to cope with new conditions and situations. And, as one’s actions change, so too does one’s sense of the world. If these changes are dramatic enough—as in Mr. I’s loss of color—then a different perceived world will be enacted (164).

This case is meant to illustrate that if one's ability to see color is completely removed, then other sensorimotor experiences are also affected. Varela et al. argue that since vision is not the only modality affected by Mr. I’s accident, his condition provides some insight into the way in which "perception and action, sensorium and motorium, are linked together as successively emergent and mutually selecting patterns" (163).

Although color is but one example of the way in which cognition is constructive, the above case study might prompt one to ask what is the proper or correct way to view the world? According to Embodied theorists, the answer is that there is no single proper or correct way of viewing the world, since being able to correctly see the world translates into using whatever sensorimotor modalities one has to act successfully in one's environment. Moreover, since an organism’s sensorimotor apparatus determines the way it will experience the world, many embodied theorists argue that instead of assuming that every organism shares the exact same view of the world (that is, we all view an objective reality in the same way), it makes more sense to acknowledge that an organism’s particular view of the world is the direct result of its functioning sensorimotor experiences. The point is that an organism’s knowledge of the world is primarily through its experiences within the world and these experiences are constrained by the types of functioning sensorimotor modalities it has. When one of these modalities is impaired, then its experience of the world will similarly be affected on multiple levels, since these modalities influence one another. The case of the colorblind painter illustrates the cross-modal natures of sensori-motor experience by showing that the impairment of one modality (color) affected the way the world was experienced in other modalities (taste, sound, etc.) to the point that certain previously performed actions suddenly no longer make sense. Therefore, the type of structural coupling that enables color perception to occur is a paradigm example of constructive cognition.

The theoretical assumption that at least some forms of cognition are constructive is supported by a growing number of theorists from a variety of disciplines. Varela et al. argue that the coupling that occurs between organism and environment results in constructive cognition. Lakoff and Johnson (1999) argue that cognition is constructive since it involves projecting schemas (e.g., bodily) and combining these schemas to create a metaphorical understanding of the world. Glenberg (1997, 1999), Damasio (1994), and Fauconnier and Turner (2002) are but a few of the cognitive scientists who maintain that cognition is in some way constructive. Thus, this theoretical assumption is becoming more widely supported in the embodied cognition literature.

3. Embodied Cognition vs. Classicism/Cognitivism

Based on the analysis of the above theoretical assumptions of embodied cognition, it is now possible to directly contrast the central themes of the embodied cognition research program with those commonly expressed in the classicist/cognitivist research program:

Classicist/Cognitivist View Embodied Cognition View
1. Computer metaphor of mind; rule-based, logic driven. 1. Coupling metaphor of mind; form of embodiment + environment + action constrain cognitive processes.
2. Isolationist analysis - cognition can be understood by focusing primarily on an organism's internal processes. 2. Relational analysis-interplay among mind, body, and environment must be studied to understand cognition.
3. Primacy of computation. 3. Primacy of goal-directed action unfolding in real time.
4. Cognition as passive retrieval. 4. Cognition as active construction based upon an organism's embodied, goal-directed actions
5. Symbolic, encoded representations 5. Sensorimotor representations

Although most embodied cognition accounts do adhere to the theoretical assumptions outlined in this entry, it is important to recognize that this rapidly changing research program encompasses a diverse group of theorists, who are continuing to refine and revise the preliminary theoretical assumptions associated with the embodied cognition view. Consequently, some accounts may reject one of the outlined assumptions, yet still identify as an embodied account of cognition.

4. Philosophical Implications of the Embodied Cognition Research Program

The ultimate claim of embodied theorists is that new insights into previously unanswered questions concerning cognitive development will be attained if cognitive scientists re-orient their approach and conduct research in a manner that acknowledges the crucial links existing among an organism's brain, body, and world. Yet, this immediately begs the question: what does it mean for researchers to re-orient their approach? Once again, there is no consensus among the embodied cognition theorists as to what this re-orientation entails; however; there are currently two distinct views concerning how cognitive scientists should apply the general embodied cognition thesis, each with different methodological implications.

a. The Compatibilist Approach

The Compatibalist Approach to Embodied Cognition involves using a variety of methods to explain cognitive processes. In some cases, the phenomena will call for a classicist/cognitivist analysis and in other cases the methods associated with the embodied cognition framework will make more sense. Researchers who endorse this compatibalist view, such as philosopher Andy Clark (1997), argue that it would be a mistake to completely dispense with the theoretical tools associated with classicist/cognitivist models, especially since it is unclear if embodied cognition accounts will be able to adequately explain higher level processes (e.g., meta-cognitive states such as the ability to think about one's own thoughts) without invoking on some level a computational or representational analysis. In short, embodied cognition theorists who endorse a compatibalist view to research are hedging their bets, and leaving open the possibility of utilizing tools from multiple theoretical frameworks. A potential problem with compatibalist conceptions is that it is not clear how mechanisms/tools derived from opposing theoretical frameworks can be successfully linked together, since these frameworks employ at best different, and at times mutually exclusive, assumptions about the world (that is, cognition is constructive vs. cognition is passive). Given this, one might question how mechanisms derived from a cognitivist framework can hook-up and mutually inform mechanisms derived from embodied frameworks so that a theoretically viable explanation emerges despite the fundamental theoretical differences. Perhaps it is this very concern that has led some embodied cognition theorists to endorse a more stringent form of embodied cognition: the purist approach to embodied cognition.

b. The Purist Approach

The Purist Approach to Embodied Cognition is often characterized as the radical version of the embodied cognition thesis because researchers who adopt it argue that the classicist/cognitivist thesis is incorrect. Consequently, they claim that any tools or theoretical mechanisms developed from classicist/cognitivist assumptions are also flawed. Instead, these classicist/cognitivist tools cannot be augmented, but must be completely replaced with a diverse set of tools/mechanisms that are consistent with the central embodied cognition thesis. One problem with the purist view of embodied cognition is that there is no guarantee that the necessary tools/mechanisms will be developed to enable embodied theorists to explain these higher cognitive processes, especially those specific to human cognition. Even though a number of promising theoretical tools currently exist (that is, dynamic systems theory, schemas, conceptual blending, mesh, etc.), those researchers who are adopting the purist approach are clearly gambling that more sophisticated theoretical tools/mechanisms will be developed in the near future to adequately explain the emergence of higher cognitive processes. Although it is too early to say definitively what the outcome will be, it is clear that the general embodiment thesis can no longer be ignored by researchers in cognitive science, including philosophers of mind, since the very thesis calls into question widely-held assumptions about cognition.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Brooks, R. (1991). "Intelligence without representation." Artificial Intelligence, 47, 139-159.
  • Clancey, W. (1997). Situated Cognition: On Human Knowledge and Computer Representations. Cambridge, MA: Cambridge University Press.
  • Clark, A. (1997). Being There: Putting Brain Body and World Together Again. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. (Recommended.)
  • Clark, A. (1999). "Embodied, situated, and distributed cognition." In W. Betchel and G. Graham (eds), A Companion to Cognitive Science, Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
  • Clark, A. and Chalmers, D. (1998). The extended mind. Analysis, 58, 7-19.
  • Cisek, P. (1999). "Beyond the Computer Metaphor: Behavior as Interaction." In Nunez, R. and Freeman, W., Reclaiming Cognition: the primacy of action intention and emotion, Bowling Green, OH: Imprint Academic.
  • Dreyfus, H. (1972/92). What Computers Can't Do: A Critique of Artificial Reason. New York: Harper and Row. (Third edition: What Computers Still Can’t Do. 1992. Cambridge, MA: MIT)
  • Fauconnier, G. and Turner, M. (2002). The Way We Think: Conceptual Blending and the Mind's Hidden Complexities. New York, NY: Basic Books.
  • Glenberg, A. (1997). "What memory is for: Creating meaning in the service of action." Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 20, 1-55.
  • Glenberg, A. (1999). "Why Mental Models Must Be Embodied." In Mental Models in Discourse Processing and Reasoning, Rickheit, G. and Habel, C. (eds). New York: Elsevier.
  • Harnad, S. (1990). "The symbol grounding problem." Physica D, 42,335-346.
  • Horgan, T and Tienson, J. (1989). "Representations Without Rules." Philosophical Topics, 17 (Spring), 147-174.
  • Hutchins, E. (1995). Cognition in the Wild. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press. (Recommended.)
  • Lakoff, G., and Johnson, M. (1999). Philosophy In the Flesh: The Embodied Mind And Its Challenge To Western Thought. New York, NY: Basic Books. (Recommended.)
  • Mataric, M. J. (1992). "Integration of representation into goal-driven behavior based robots." IEEE Transactions on Robotics and Automation, 8 (3): 304-312.
  • Searle, J. (1980). "Minds, brains, and programs." Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 1, 417-424.
  • Thelen, E.,and Smith, L. (1994). A Dynamic Systems Approach to the Development of Cognition and Action. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Thelen, E. (1995). "Time-scale dynamics in the development of an embodied cognition." In Mind In Motion, ed. R. Port and T. van Gelder. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Thelen, E., Schoner, G., Scheier, C., and Smith, L.B.(2001). "The Dynamics of Embodiment: A Field Theory of Infant Perservative Reaching." Behavioral and Brain Sciences 24: 1-86.
  • Varela, F., Thompson, E., Rosch, E. (1991). The Embodied Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Author Information

Monica Cowart
Merrimack College
U. S. A.

Moral Development

This entry analyzes moral development as a perennial philosophical view complemented by modern empirical research programs. The two initial sections summarize what moral development is and why it is important for ethics and human nature theory. The “Roots” section notes historical versions of natural development in morality, touching on Confucius, Aristotle, Rousseau and Rawls. The next four sections assess current empirical research in moral psychology focusing on the cognitive-developmental approach of Piaget and Kohlberg and its philosophical theory. In the “Critical Specifics” section, controversies are taken up in stage theories of moral development focusing major rivalries in moral philosophy, critical and feminist theory. “Caring’s Different Voice” focuses on conflicts between justice and benevolence ethics. The “Pedagogical Implications” of moral cognition research are then summarized with a focus on classroom practices. Finally, “Related Research” is surveyed on the roles of moral perception, identity, empathy, convention/tradition, altruism and egoism, along with new moral-automaticity notions in cognitive science.

Table of Contents

  1. What it is
  2. What it is for
  3. Roots
  4. Empirical Philosophy (Cognitive-Developmentalism)
  5. Moral Stages of Reasoning
  6. Philosophical Research Method
  7. Philosophical Interpretation of Findings
  8. Critical Specifics
  9. Caring's "Different Voice"
  10. Pedagogical Implications
  11. Related Research
  12. References and Further Reading

1. What it is

Human nature is naturally good. At least it leans decidedly toward an awareness of the good, and a preference for it, over evil and injustice. Despite appearances, human nature is inherently self-realizing and self-perfecting, if in moral understanding and aspiration more than practice. Morality grows in human beings spontaneously alongside physical limbs, basic mental and social capacities. Both individually and in social interaction the human species evolves mature moral conscience and character despite the many psychological and social impediments that slow or de-rail the process for a time.

These are the basic tenets of moral development in its most vital, if naive historical form--a dominant perspective in ancient ethics and traditional religion. By painting human nature in this ultimately elevated and dignified posture, moral development visions grounded an ultimate hope in human progress. They forecast the flowering of our species' most humane and admirable potentials, leaving behind its troubled childhood.

Under critical scrutiny, moral development notions gradually surrendered their identification of human psychology with virtue. But for German idealism, however, their credibility continued to wane reaching a low ebb in the mid twentieth century when the "naturalness" of human morality seemed hardest to square with the stunning inhumanity engulfing much of the world at war. Scientifically, a continually strengthening fact-value distinction also placed “natural” and “moral” on opposite sides of the fence causing the history of moral development and perfectionist notions to seem mired in fallacy.

Only in the latter 19th century did moral development revive as a lively research field in social science led by the cognitive-developmental approach of Jean Piaget and Lawrence Kohlberg. Newfound credibility for this effort was garnered by abandoning the traditional geneticist position in moral development, which depicted even sophisticated moral reasoning as a physiologically, age-determined phenomenon. For cognitive-developmentalists, instead, natural development involves complex combinations of trial-and-error social interaction, guided only indirectly by certain implastic similarities in human motivation and basic cross-cultural institutions of social life. While these processes allow great variation in moral and quasi-moral socialization, their interaction yields remarkably similar patterns of coping. Only certain cognitive strategies seem capable of navigating basic social interaction successfully. Research suggests that the cognitive competences fueling them and their ordering in a certain sequence are practically unavoidable for functioning in human society. And these cognitive competences are decidedly moral in key and holistic respects.

2. What it is for

In human nature theory (or axiology) moral development notions convey a sense of ourselves as dynamic and progressive beings. It is normal for us to be ever-evolving and aspiring beyond ourselves even beyond the maturity of adulthood. Being potentially perfect or self-realizing, we inherit an august natural legacy to fulfill in our individual characters and through community, which reveals our hidden but awesome inherent worth. On this view, we owe it to ourselves not to sit still or languish in anything less than the full completion and perfection of all our potentials and powers.

Morally speaking, making progress in this supremely elevated cause is less daunting than its supreme end-point would suggest. We are naturally prone toward it after all. What we are obliged to do is what comes most natural to us deep down. The physical and psychological laws that govern our fundamental nature are all pulling for us, offering staunch and unremitting supporting for our journey toward ideals. For ethical perfectionism, supporting by natural development, the difficult "why be moral?" was airily brushed aside in the answer, “Because it's who we are, because it’s self-fulfilling, because it is what we are meant to be.”

But such answers raise powerful questions. If we are so ideal deep down, why are we such disappointments everywhere else? Why do we fall so characteristically short in our characters and communities, showing all manner of vice and corruption, and making a cruel and violent mess of our world?

The typical response to such telling observations comes packaged in "alienation theory." Either the outside world corrupts us—a world we can not well control. Or the inside world corrupts us. The human part of our aspiration comes freighted with, and mired in, the lustful, grasping, animal portion of our heritage, a portion not only difficult to control but bent on running us morally out of control. Or most ironic, we corrupt ourselves, conspiring unwittingly with these other corrupting influences due to the imperfect state and function of our all-too-slowly developing capacities. Our aspiring saint within is dogged not only by demons without and within, but by the natural imperfection of time needed. For most of its course development provides us only formative tools for dealing with hostilities that greet us full-formed from the start, always at the top of their game. Our ongoing inadequacies entrench themselves as habits in personality and as social institutions guiding socialization, making our already thorny path thornier still by our own misguided hand.

The alienation gambit loses perfectionist ethics its edge over competitors, sharing their disadvantages. Perfectionist principles must engage in just as much pleading and haranguing to have us walk the straight and narrow path against the stiff wind of temptation. Our development task takes on dual roles in this struggle. Building character requires clearing away the impediments to self-discipline and social righteousness. We must fight mental distractions, motivational lusts, prejudices, false ideologies, the myriad lures of false appearance and materialist obsession. With these temptations somewhat in hand, we must shine brightly forth from our natural core, "polishing our mirrors" so that unfolding capacities rise to their full level of flourishing. This pro-active urging of our spontaneous development is natural as well. Faced with the prospect of such awesome self-realization we can not just sit idly by, watching it take its natural pace, but instead offer a boost.

3. Roots

In ancient philosophies, moral development was normally conceived "teleologically." This means defining the inherent reality or essence of a moral phenomenon by the valuable function or purpose it ultimately serves. Teleology is a strong version of functionalism—x is what x does (well).

Confucian traditions attributed "four beginnings" to human personality, which naturally unfolded into defining human virtues. These were reason (which becomes moral understanding) affiliation or fellow-feeling (which transmutes into compassion), resentment (which yields a sense of justice) and feelings of guilt and shame (which become moral regret at having done wrong). Moving from initial inner drives to polished virtues in such a direct way stretches plausibility. It leaves mysterious how such socially subtle and adept abilities spring forth from such psychologically isolated and internal roots, despite all the other influences apparently at play. This contrasts with the Confucian view of how ritual institutions in society guide the careful crafting of artful behaviors.

Aristotle also focuses on habituation regarding ethical virtues. But strands of natural growth and moral evolution are embedded throughout his depiction of human flourishing. For him, ethical happiness or flourishing is the fulfillment of our natural human function. The "Aristotelean Principle" of cognitive motivation is one such strand, moving us to prefer more complex to less complex activities. This pulls us toward greater challenges and resulting cognitive growth in dealing with them over time. The development of the intellectual virtues is largely a process of natural growth toward natural function. And some of these (logos and sophrosune especially) play necessary roles in the proper expression of ethical virtues.

Aristotle's approach was more plausible because its natural growth only provided tools and tendencies for able behavior. No assumption need be made that human nature is distinctly moral. With these general abilities and sensibilities in place, social experience could pick up the developing story, shaping norm-compliant traits along and behaviors. An apparent psychological principle toward moderation leaned this process norm-compliance farther toward moral norms since many distinctly moral virtues arise at the mean between and under- and overflow of non-moral motivation.

In general, the more indirect and morally non-distinctive the view, the more plausible it depicts moral development. Developmental views of morality themselves make such an advance on earlier innatist viewpoints that locate full-blown moral insight and virtue in our souls from birth. Such views cannot explain the anomaly of moral wisdom amidst the naiveté of all other childhood beliefs, nor the failure of this wisdom to actually show itself. Likewise, direct moral development views cannot explain evolution's highly distinctive selection of such a complexly civilized and culturally mediated form of social reasoning and cooperation. Nor can they explain why peculiarly institutionalized social experience seems necessary to attain full natural edification and character.

In general, also, the logic of moral development history tells us more than its authorship, suggesting strategies for the philosophical progress on the concept. Our "inherent goodness" is best viewed as akin to genetic instructions for seeking social competence, and competence in a general sense. The basic instruction is to unpack and upgrade personality potencies as suits whichever environments will welcome their designs. Some parts of the social environment will welcome the combined expression of cognitive and social talents that enable cooperation. Some combination will be practically geared, some geared more to prudent reciprocity and mutual expectation in kind. Those that are mutually beneficial across these dimensions will progress, in a general sense of beneficial or valuable. Some will function to produce norms, and institutionalize them—norms of various sorts.

As social organization and practice moves toward beneficial divisions of labor, some norms will engender bind with traditions, other generate laws and legal systems, and some foster moral tenets of mutual fairness and respect, mutual reliance and aid. Again, each norm system endures primarily because of its respective benefits such as sense of social continuity, belonging, meaning, or worth. Our cognitive and social capacities will help shape these distinct practices and tailor their functions to them. Those that take moral shape thereby realize our inherent moral nature.

To the degree this process is unavoidable in the moral realm, and progresses in an unavoidable manner, it is natural. Yet its distinctive moral nature arises naturally, for the most part, as the fruition of its basically non-moral or morally undifferentiated path. On this indirect view, it is not that uprightness simply works in the world, as our limbs do. It is that general competencies differentiate and partner, adapting to and helping shape differentiated social environments, some of which take a moral shape and demand moral functions from them. This explains why moral tendencies would be attractive to biological selection and evolution—why our "survivalist" human psycho-biology would turn toward admirable sociality along a progressive, age-appropriate time line.

The perfectionist legacy found in writers as diverse as Augustine and Nietzche carried this indirect approach forward, more and less. Perfectionist principles urged us to develop a range of non-moral traits, serving certain individual needs and interpersonal problem-solving functions. When practiced, polished, and performed artfully together, within an artfully organized social system, these rise to the level of virtues and find their moral niche.

With the decline of teleological metaphysics and axiology, the "natural development" of morality assumed a more purely functionalist form. (Development was not pulled by a potential telos or end-point; rather it foreshadows that end-point by able handling the means to it.) Arguable, this requires that moral development be reconceived as a distributed property, crossing various domains. One might be a perfectionist ethic, a second, the functional psychology on which it rides, and, third, the adaptive needs each serves for the individual and society (Puka 1980). In such combination, moral development becomes a naturally motivated striving to fulfill those prescriptions that bid us nurture and express certain virtues. These are the virtues that, in turn, produce an effective personality and excellent overall character while fostering a thriving, progressive society.

To avoid circularity, such naturalistic views strained historically to distinguish between descriptively and normatively "natural" psychological processes—between normal and adaptive, that is. They strained further to distinguish “adaptive” from “morally apt or desirable.” And their perfectionist ethical component strained hardest to represent the transitions from minimal moral ability to high moral excellence as a smooth and homogeneous continuum. This is a stretch because excellence by its admirable nature seems extraordinary, not “natural;” it requires special efforts, not mere formative growth, to attain.

Where such straining fails, the logic of moral development falls into various fallacies, seeming to build moral norms into social and psychological ones by fiat, then trying to pass the attempt off as descriptive or factual. Efforts to avoid this outcome are worthwhile because of the valuable function moral development serves in ethics.

Any morality faces so-called strains of commitment. At base, these are strains on motivational rationality. The ultimate logical question, "Why be moral" has real-world versions: why act as I am told I should when it conflicts with what I want—with what motivates me? why struggle toward a life of integrity, when the childhood propensity to duck and weave promises an easier path to a fun-filled life? This question raises the prospect that being intellectually moral is motivationally unnatural or irrational, or even pathological. What suits our reason likely doesn't suit our full range of motivations (some stronger than reason) that reason, to be reasonable, should take into account. As noted, the most powerful psychological answer is this. “Because doing right is what is in fact most fulfilling overall: w are spontaneously drawn to it at all levels of need, desire and interest, the more so as we grow. Moral integrity produces greater self-esteem and personal satisfaction than material acquisition and social status. Thus morally we need follow our ever-increasing propensities to do what we should, exerting that little extra to bolster and stretch those propensities. The extra effort pays tenfold in making us more of what we are at our best.”

In these respects, moral development is to ethical perfectionism what psychological egoism is to ethical egoism. It renders excellent character and virtue natural, relatively easy to achieve, fulfilling, and therefore motivationally rational. Immorality does not seem so naturally desirable to us here that it must be forbidden. Instead, it presents merely tepid attraction, notable debilitation, and therefore, an undesirable cast overall. Natural development in morality, however, can serve any type of ethic, perfectionist or otherwise, providing the needed psychological resources for fulfilling whatever obligations and pursuits it recommends. Unfortunately, neither ancient teleological views of moral development nor their functionalist successors detailed the presumed processes of psycho-moral evolution. Nor did they clarify the relation of nature to nurture involved. This pointed to the need for copious empirical investigation.

Recent philosophical history gave a rare nod to moral development through Rawls's (1972) A Theory of Justice. Like Kant before him, Rawls paid homage to Rousseau’s vision of moral cooperation. Such cooperation is nature’s way of humanizing and civilizing the human race, not merely of institutionalizing humanity’s civilizing intent to stabilize and protect it. But we see in Rawls’s hands the degree to which supporting ethical prescriptions with psychological proclivities has retreated under threats from the naturalistic fallacy, and other category mistakes. Rawls recognizes only the logical requirement that just social institutions remain compatible with the facts of human psychology and its development so that socializing each successive generation in justice institutions will be a feasible enterprise, assuring compliance. He does not turn to moral development for moral support, grounding value prescriptions on its facts.

Rawls relied on a pre-scientific account of moral development (Rousseau's Emile), when an entire field of social science provided an empirically-based alternative. (This field was centered just a short stroll from Rawls’s Harvard office). We see here philosophy’s reluctance to rest enduring theory on the current state of empirical research programs. (Quine paid the price of resting the epistemology of Word and Object too heavily on the Skinnerian psychology of operant conditioning.) But we also see the skepticism and controversy that marks the research field of moral development and its guiding light, Lawrence Kohlberg. Philosophy gratefully accepted the flattering role of guide in the design of Kohlberg’s research design and the interpretation of data. But Kohlberg’s presumptive preferences for one rival philosophy over all others smacked of ideological partisanship. It raised philosophical hackles as well when Kantianism was provided empirical validation, while Utilitarianism, intuitionist virtue theory and the like were disconfirmed. Had evolution really selected Kant’s categorical imperative as our racial destiny? The title of Kohlberg’s first ethics monograph did nothing to mollify philosophical ire: "From Is to Ought: How To Commit the Naturalistic Fallacy in the Study of Moral Development and Get Away With It."

4. Empirical Philosophy (Cognitive-Developmentalism)

In contemporary terms, "moral development" is a research specialty of cognitive and developmental psychology, with associated research in anthropology, cognitive science, social and political psychology, law and education. A strong research partnership with moral theorists has marked this field's development from the outset. Researchers trace evolving systems of competence in interpreting, judging, and reasoning out moral problems. These cognitive systems incorporate empathic and social role-taking abilities that promote interpersonal negotiation, relation, and community (Selman vol. 2, Hoffman vol. 5, 7) [(References with volume numbers in the text refer to the series Moral Development: A Compendium)].

But they do not cover as much of personality, sociality, or character as the original teleological notions of human nature. Attempts to find anything like natural development in such breadth of human psychology and personality were empirically unsuccessful.

Empirical research that relies so heavily on leading philosophical conceptions, distinctions and methods of analysis cannot help but interest philosophers. Its results are highly relevant to philosophical debates, suggesting important roles for philosophy in scientific practice. The Piagetian definition of moral development's domain distinguishes fruitfully between morality, morals, ethics (as in professional codes), cultural ethos, and Ethics (as "worthy living."). Normative reasoning and reflective meta-cognition is also carefully distinguished within commonsense cognition itself. Research focuses on phenomena that have enough internal stability and cohesiveness to be said to develop--to undergo change while retaining identity and to evolve inherent, of their own accord. (This contrasts with being shaped externally, in ways that supplant an earlier version with a somewhat similar successor over time.) Great care is taken as well to demonstrate that the moral quality of observed phenomena are improving, not simply the functional sophistication of the psychological structure in which it is embedded (Kohlberg 1981).

Normative moral theory helps design the main research tools in moral development (the posing of research dilemmas and interpretation of findings). Moral-philosophical concepts are used to define empirical coding (identification) and scoring (rating) categories by issue, judgment, rationale or principle. The success of these categories suggests that the structural adequacy of moral theory derives in part from the functionality of its logic in common sense and practice. This renders those theoretical accounts of ethics that rise from "considered moral judgments" more than armchair credibility. It suggests, moreover, that difficulties faced in applying moral principles to socio-moral issues are worth the effort, and should turn out surmountable with effort. Paths have been chartered from moral judgment to theory that should be traversable in reverse direction.

Obviously, general moral principles and their logical prescriptivity indicate little in themselves about the feasibility of an ethic. Thus the philosopher must welcome any empirical account that renders reasoning a motivating and practically effective force. Moral developmentalists detail a variety of ways that conceptual competence itself motivates principled choice and action, while also partnering with moral emotions. Uncovering empirical evidence of a distinct competence-motivation principle is a great boon to theories of practical reason and intention generally, given how central conceptualization is to human competence and adaptivity. Showing a close affiliation between reasons and emotions, competence motivation and interest principles (the pleasure principle, law of effect or reinforcement) further bolsters the case.

But the philosophical bounty from moral development goes farther. A zeal for distinguishing facts from value judgments had driven modern psychology to explain morality away. Taking crudely reductionist stands, behaviorists portrayed morality as outward conformity to the prevailing ethos of one's social environment. Freudians, in turn, depicted morality as a combination of irrational forces born of biological drives, coupled with ego-defensive coping in the face of social threats and presses. These portrayals not only create a disjunct between moral philosophy and the psychology its views must ride on in practice, but between moral theory and social science generally.

Cognitive developmentalism restored the role of reason and discriminating emotion in moral choice. It provided a central role for self-determination and distinctly moral autonomy to boot. Cognitive research traces the detailed psychological processes by which children unconsciously, yet self-constructively recreate their own systems of thought and self. In so doing they resist the coercion of inherited and socialized influences enough to gain control over their thinking—to in fact use these forces as raw materials for structuring their thought. Tracing these processes provides empirical evidence of the deep, two-level sort of self-determination on which even the most rationalist and autonomy-focused philosophical ethics of Kantianism can stand. Psychology's more realistic and blended notion of "cognition" also suggests ways to overcome philosophy’s own pre-empirical divide between rationalism and emotivism or related voluntarism and determinism.

Further research on meta-cognition indicates that even common sense reasoning distinguishes between interested values, moral conventions, and autonomous morality. It depicts the former as merely interested and conventional, as morally arbitrary and relative, akin to tastes and fads. The latter, by contrast, it requires to invoke reasoned support and validating evidence (Turiel vol. 2, 4). Commonsense reasoning goes further in attributing distinctly moral responsibility to people for the self-determined choices and autonomous self-expressions they make (Blasi 2004 ).

While ancient philosophical views placed our psyches in the driver's seat of "natural development," they also provided the environment a guiding role. On this adaptation model social environment not only “watered” our inner growth, but provided the channels through which it unfolded properly. Unless society and nature stayed within the “normal,” “civil,” or even welcoming range, our personal growth and character would become stunted. With a modern psychology divided into environmentalists or geneticists on development, a cognitivist revival of the social-interactionist, moral adaptivity perspective was a crucial innovation.

5. Moral Stages of Reasoning

Jean Piaget (vol. 1) recognized the virtues of trying to reduce development either to nature or nurture. This is a tried and true theoretical research strategy in science and philosophy, reflecting the virtues of explanatory parsimony. Piagetians credited the role of socialization in developing moral ideologies and emotions. They saw the importance of guilt, shame and pride in reinforcing prevailing norms of right and wrong, also in developing ego-ideals and an aversive conscience-system to avoid censure from social authorities. But they recognized that even the most optimistic projections of such behaviorist and Freudian potential falls far short of capturing sophisticated moral deliberation and problem solving, not to mention interpersonal negotiation and relationship

Piaget introduced a third factor, the cognitive schema or system, that mediated the interplay of bio-psychology and socialization. He asked children to describe their intention and behavior, their goals and aspirations, and how they made sense of them. In this way, Piagetians have produced decades of evidence that children co-construct their moral reality much as they construct their physical reality and epistemology—organizing concepts as practical tools for interacting effectively with the world. The "tool" metaphor had special appeal when observing the continuity between using our limbs and coordinating our bodily movements in infancy, then using our conceptual categorizations of reality and coordinating their use through “logical” operations. Piagetians also demonstrated that continual enhancements to these operating systems could be depicted structurally, using the laws of propositional logic. This greatly improved the practical outlook for what seemed abstracted and overly general theory.

While tracing sequences of stages in the development of logical and scientific reasoning, however, Piaget only uncovered two somewhat cohesive systems of naturally-developing moral thought. The childhood "heteronomous" phase conditioned right and responsibility on concrete interests. It focused on conformity to approved social conventions as means of fulfilling them. The adult “autonomous phase” showed greater concern with doing the right thing per se within the framework of mutual purposes. This phase arose as children became critical and self-critical about their conventional moral beliefs and the social institutions supporting them, also as they began comparing different possible moral policies and practices with each other, intuiting the sorts of social purposes they needed to serve. The ability to intuit these purposes, even in the face of sparse and misleading information, is one of our great naturally-developing achievements. It provides intriguing support for those moral-political theorists who believe that the social contract model of ethics and just government is anything but the intellectual fiction that classical authors considered it. Still, with Piaget, it is unclear that the ancient philosophy of moral development and its inclusion within natural development of human personality had been reclaimed.

Lawrence Kohlberg determined to investigate whether there was much more detail and sophistication to the natural development of moral reasoning. And he doggedly pursued this singular investigation until his death, some thirty-five years later. In drawing hundreds of colleagues into his empirical and educational mission, across the globe, he virtually established moral development as a field. Kohlberg's approach centers the field to this day, with no comparable rival but skepticism. However, much research is performed using a simpler device (DIT) developed by Rest and colleagues (2000) that also yields findings on more components of moral judgment than Kohlberg’s MJI. The continuing program of Kohlbergians and neo-Kohlbergians is best known for a moral judgment interview technique that led to a particular six-stage theory of moral judgment,also for educational programs designed to edify at-risk urban students and prison inmates, and notably, for "being controversial." Philosophers have participated actively in the moral development debate, making Kohlberg’s work both well-known and infamous in ethics. Perhaps it should be best known for being poorly understood and critiqued.

The range of philosophical critiques that some believe discredit Kohlberg suffer from two basic flaws. They do not consider the likelihood that Kohlberg's key interpretive models and claims are dispensable in his developmental theory. Nor do they try out the alternative position they favor (the position Kohlberg’s view is allegedly biased against) to see if this makes an appreciable difference for the findings involved. This violates normal philosophical policy on apt analysis. These shortfalls suggest a dismissive prejudgment of Kohlberg theory, based perhaps on prevailing intellectual ideologies. Contemporary thinking is averse to the apparent pigeon-holing of complex systems or inflexible (hierarchically) ordering of complex processes. Kohlberg’s frustratingly casual use of philosophical methods and overblown use of philosophical notions support such pre-judgment.

Even cursory observation suggests that Kohlberg's philosophical self-depictions are dispensable indeed, leaving the empirically-based core of his theory in tact, and that his assessment of findings can be performed using a range of explanatory and meta-ethical standards (Puka vol. 4, Colby, Kohlberg. et. al. 1987). Kohlberg need not claim that observed development occurs in unified stages that are hierarchically integrated and arise in invariant sequence, that they culminate in a highest stage of a particular sort, or that stage development and the morality it captures is "natural" or “universal” in any cross-cultural sense. The leading theories of cognitive, ego, and social development do not make claims of this extreme sort, and yet are held adequate and valuable without them. Philosophers should be able to distinguish a developmental theory derived from data from further claims, derived theoretically, regarding the ethical significance of certain findings.

Kohlberg's strongest and most criticized philosophical claim--that justice and rights are the central concepts of morality--is the most obviously dispensable. Kohlberg’s perennial stage descriptions center on different moral concept or theme in every stage such as prudence, benevolence, or advancing social welfare. They are even titled in this way. It was not until the fifteenth year of advancing the well-known stage theory that Kohlberg even seriously tried to find "justice operations" working in each of the stages (Colby and Kohlberg 1987).

Kohlberg's even more fundamental claim that moral development can only be chartered where morality is non-relative seems dispensable. Moral judgment can become relatively developed, as aesthetic and culinary judgment does. There are clearly more and less developed palates and tastes, which would hold for morality were it mainly a matter of taste. Perhaps the most valuable service performed by Rest and colleagues (2000) in summarizing their twenty-years of neo-Kohlbergian research is to present the data without Kohlberg’s bold claims, showing that the stage sequence remains.

6. Philosophical Research Method

Drawing from the literature of moral philosophy, Kohlberg hypothesized that justice-as-fairness was the central moral concept, also that conflict resolution and fostering mutual cooperation were its chief aims and marks of adequacy. Kohlberg thus presented experimental subjects with moral conflicts and cooperation scenarios, recording their strategies for resolving the dilemmas involved. ( In the original longitudinal study, 52 subjects from a private Chicago boy's school were interviewed every 3-4 years for 35 years (Colby and Kohlberg 1987)). Interview probe questions also challenged these strategies to uncover the subject’s highest level of ability versus present performance. Additional interview questions asked subjects to address issues of fairness, right, rights, responsibility, equality, guilt, law versus morality, values and ideals, promise-keeping and loyalty, benevolence and love in family relations and friendships (Kohlberg 1984). These dilemmas and questions provided respondents the opportunity to couch their responses at different social perspectives and within different social units, from primary and intimate relations to social-institutional and international perspectives.

After coding recorded interview responses (in logical, social, moral categories) Kohlberg and colleagues looked for patterns. They were particularly interested in whether the template of Piagetian stages could be put over the logical, social-perspectival, and moral aspects of responding. The results showed a six-stage sequence of such stages ranging from (a) a pre-conventional level in which children think egoistically or instrumentally, using each other to get what they want, through (b) a conventional level in which conformity to the institutional practices of one's peer group and society are key toward maintaining group solidarity and stability, to (c) a post-conventional level at which morality is seen as a mutually created institution serving certain shared and elevated purposes—some achieved, some still being pursued. The post-conventional level shows commonsense rationales resembling those of reciprocal respect-for-persons, rule- utilitarianism, and libertarian rights.

Kohlberg's non-empirical theorizing offended philosophical sensibilities by claiming that these findings on post-conventional morality especially support the adequacy of leading moral theories. To philosophers it seemed unlikely enough that natural selection equipped us to reproduce Kant, Mill and Locke when trying to deal with each other. Alternatively, it seemed unlikely that only these three individuals discovered and portrayed our universal moral inheritance. Claiming that the naturalistic fallacy had been overcome in this way--through a few dozens clinical interviews with Chicago school kids--also seemed a bit bold. Overlooked here is the obvious. Outside the internal debates of moral philosophers, the advisability of building general explanatory theories in a practical field like ethics is not clear. Neither is it clear that such theories can provide useful guides for choice and action. Thus hard evidence that theories further refine and elaborate thinking that works effectively on real-world moral problems should be welcome news.

Less known to philosophers are Kohlbergian observations on developmental process and its uncanny resemblance to intellectual theory building. These same observations may offer mutual support for the common sense and intellectual search for "unified theories" or understandings. The developmental process, left out of traditional accounts, starts with trial and error inquiry and experimental observation, then the differentiation of elements and observed relations among them in one's observational field. Next these elements and relations are integrated via overarching rationales or principles designed to unify them and achieve a close correspondence between cognitive and environmental structure. The correspondence achieved is gauged functionally, by testing cognition’s predictive validity in practice. Such testing is part of general processing or assimilation of information to the stage structure achieved. This expresses ongoing competence levels until discrepant information is noticed (differentiated). Such information is then assimilated reductionistically to the structure until the discrepancies become too great and numerous. Then the structure is partially loosened or disassembled (disequilibrated) so that existing rationales can work in more ad hoc fashion, piecing together novel responses where needed. Additional ad hoc operating principles are added as well until a new more unified and coherent operating structure can be formed. When it does, we have completed stage-transition. Then the process of differentiation, accommodation, integration, and assimilative equilibrium begins once more.

While all these processes are self-constructional, they all occur quite unconsciously. This says something remarkable about our pre-intellectual capacities and routines, making the trained philosophical intellect appear less effete.

7. Philosophical Interpretation of Findings

Armed with these observations on developmental stages and processes, Kohlberg derived a range of overarching. They regarded their invariant moral and psychological progression, their spontaneous (untutored) and self-constructive quality, and their universality. In addition to launching a program of cross-cultural research, Kohlberg again consulted the philosophical literature for standards of logical, normative and meta-ethical adequacy. Gauging century-old debates, Kohlberg concluded that formal Kantian criteria as less problematic than alternatives. And he installed them as measures of moral progress in development, sketching how each stage more closely fulfilled them (Kohlberg 1981).

A host of commentators later charged Kohlberg's methodology with formalist, Kantian, and liberal-egalitarian bias. Such charges have a point. Kohlberg, after all, had not experimented with using other meta-criteria for gauging moral progress. He did not show the caution of other social scientists who imported preferred theories from other disciplines, utilizing them more hypothetically and tentatively. Still, such criticism ignores the more powerful and generalizable assessment Kohlberg offered: the stage-by-stage-comparisons in which increasing completeness and inclusivity marked moral adequacy. Here each new stage of reasoning, each operating system, was shown to add a major type of principled operation that performed a vital problem-solving function. At the same time, each retained the least problematic structures and operations of all previous stages. A largely bottom-up assessment is involved here, gauging progress away from basic inadequacy and incompleteness in both psychological and moral processing. Examples would include not considering the social or interpersonal dimension of a problem, not considering the role of key values, virtues, or responsibilities that any conceptual analysis would consider relevant.

Applied to later-stage reasoning, such assessments invoke very basic and shared adequacy criteria among competing ethical outlooks. As such they match Piaget's approach to measuring mature logical reasoning. Such "formal-operational" thought shows the competence to consider all relevant causal possibilities, from the most relevant perspectives required, to address a wide range of scientific problems.

It is worth noting that Kohlberg's stage sequence likely measures up on rival meta-ethical measures, e.g., on rule-utilitarian criteria of a quasi-teleological, quasi-intuitionist form. This is true, at least, so long as the weighted utilities or rules involved stress justice and rights, as in Mill, or in Bentham’s "each is to count for one" proviso. There is good reason for preferring such a utilitarian lean as well; the perennial list of criticisms lodged against utilitarianism call for it. Utilitarianism is unable to assure minimal fairness and equality, to view such considerations and others as morally inherent and untradable, to create moral disjuncts that set upper limits on obligation and lower limits on decency, to accord proper place and protection for individual autonomy, and the like. While Kohlberg never attempted such an analysis, those criticizing the lack of one never even suggested why it would be difficult to perform.

While Kohlberg originally claimed a sixth and highest stage of moral development that put Kantian respect and individual rights first. But his research program eventually recanted this finding. Ongoing worldwide research, combined with the statistical reanalyzes of existing data, de-legitimated the significance of many Stage 6 observations, leaving too little reliable data for Stage 6 claims. This locates the highest empirical stage in Kohlberg's theory in the same place that mainstream moral philosophy finds itself after two centuries of debate—with two main competing sets of principles, one fostering the advancement of social welfare and benevolent virtues, the other a mutual respect for individual liberty. These are accompanied by several intuitive rationales concerning goods of community, interpersonal responsibility and loyalty, equal economic opportunity and toleration, and various virtues of friendship. This state of ethical affairs approaches quasi-intuitionist rule-utilitarian criteria at least as well as it approaches Kantian, deontological ones.

The presence of interpersonal and virtue rationales in later moral development is often overlooked. Indeed, Kohlberg's own stage descriptions downplay them by focusing on what is new and distinctive in each later stage of development, not on what is inclusively preserved from earlier stages. General ethical principles are the innovation in later stages because they reflect a broadened social perspective. This misleading emphasis in stage depictions was deemed necessary by the history of stage scoring system in research, Scorers constantly confounded similar moral rationales, expressed in adjacent stage terms. Thus distinctive stage-qualities had to be emphasized at each stage. Philosophical critics who do not immerse themselves within the empirical research project and its requirements miss matters of this sort completely, failing to credit ways in which an empirically-based theory can not be altered simply to serve conceptual goals such as neutrality or elegance.

8. Critical Specifics

Critics rightly fault the over-interpreted nature of Kohlberg's initial research as well as the inflated nature of his claims relative to reliable data. Qualitative research generally offers poor safeguards against an author’s peculiar interpretive preferences, helping to shape the very content of observational "data." Recognizing this, Kohlberg invited heretics and critics of his view into his central research group over time. His conceptual interpretations were radically reanalyzed in the 1980s seeking consensus among a dozen ideologically conflicting coders and scorers, working contentiously together.

Initially, Kohlberg was not careful to control either his qualitative research method or his theory-building process for biases. Ideological (liberal) and gender (male) biases proved hardest to tame. The Kohlberg program cannot legitimately be faulted simply for having a particular focus: it need not address the full diversity of relevant topics in moral psychology. But it has clearly fallen short in considering phenomena that strongly interact with those investigated, changing their nature. Certain moral emotions should have been researched that help set cognitive orientation, gather crucial information (Blum 1980), or facilitate moral self-expression and relation (Gilligan vol. 6). Empathy and compassion should have been investigated alongside cognitive role-taking and perspective-taking since, as moral competences, they are unlikely to function separately (Hoffman vol. 7). The same can be said for the relation of moral cognitive and meta-cognition at higher levels of development (Gibbs vol.4, 5). Kohlberg followed Piaget in conceiving moral development personally and psychologically, not seriously researching the phenomenon as an interpersonal or relational process above all, or one pertaining primarily to small communities. Such apparent shortfalls top a virtual catalogue of charged deficiencies, some holding particular philosophical interest.

Methodological: (1) Empirical researchers should seek their subjects' own opinions on what morality encompasses and when it progresses or sinks low. Moral relevance and adequacy should not be pre-defined by "expert" theorists on theoretical grounds exclusively, intellectually limiting the scope and determining the emphasis of research. (2) At least one survey (Gilligan and Murphy vol. 4) indicates that subjects spontaneously conceive morality as setting value priorities or aspiring toward ideals when conceiving morality, as well as defining the kind of person one is. Testing subjects’ abilities to resolve conflicts of interest doesn’t get at these (teleological) moral sensibilities. (3) The use of an all-male sample in Kohlberg’s original, central, and ongoing study of moral development is not only unacceptable by present-day research standards. Instead, given the accumulated data on gender differences, the results should be radically reinterpreted as tracing male moral development primarily, not natural or human development. (4) The stage-system model of moral development does violence to data that shows a majority of subjects scoring at two and sometimes even three adjacent “stages” (out of five). This suggests that people remain distributed across the range of their development for most of their lives in a loose confederation of rationales and beliefs. (5) Asking research subjects to first resolve a moral dilemma then give reasons for their choice does not focus on moral reasoning or problem-solving competence, but on the ability to explain or justify judgments. Such an approach can not even distinguish justification from self-deceptive rationalization.

Conceptual: (1) Due to the many cultural and epochal influences on cognition, conceptual safeguards should have been in place to assure that American research on moral development did not unduly reflect western ideology. This includes the "social contract" or “natural rights” heritage of Anglo-American ideology (Sullivan vol. 4). (2) Defining adequate moral judgments as the decisive resolution of conflicting interests or duties fails to inquire into non-decisive, non-contending moral competences and their adequacy. These might include trying to avoid or skirt moral dilemmas due to harm done some parties by resolving them, or trying to pre-empt moral dilemmas through dialogue and negotiation aimed at altering the prior interests of involved parties (Gilligan and Murphy vol. 6). (3) Interpreting moral responses in exclusively structural or systemic terms, organized by general principles, ignores intuitionist and pluralist ethical considerations. It also ignores emotional sensibilities and intelligences, thus grossly distorting the moral-development profile. (4) Focusing moral development research on reasoning, not on traits producing expressive behavior, misses what is adequacy about moral development. The observed judgment-action gap allows a highest stage reasoner to be a high-level hypocrite, self-deceiver, and cad (Straughan vol. 4). (5) A great intermixing of moral and political perspectives, as well as similar moral and political concepts seems to occur in later developmental stages, as in some philosophical theories. Do we interpret this as a natural developing competence or incompetence? It fails in cognitive differentiation, yet seemingly shares a tendency found in expert ethical theories.

Kohlbergians have often tested and accommodated the panoply of criticisms leveled at them. Thus they have come to see the dialectic of debate as the central natural developmental course of their research program. Their absorption of many critics into their research team adds credibility to this portrayal. Some critiques have not yet been addressed however, and should be. As philosophers seem unaware, however, later phases of the Kohlberg research program arguably have evolved the most psychometrically sophisticated coding and scoring system known to qualitative research (Colby and Kohlberg 1987). This system offers the most sophisticated integration available of conceptual and empirical assessments for interpreting data and drawing conclusions from it, and arguably has generated the most impressive results in of any research program in cognitive development or moral psychology by far--winning over major opponents (Kurtines and Grief vol. 4).

In addition, Kohlberg's original thirty-year study, begun with the least sophisticated methodology and fewest bias controls recently received a thorough empirical reanalysis by Edelstein and Keller (vol. 5) which surprisingly confirmed most original Kohlberg findings. As noted, twenty-years of parallel studies using a completely different research measure than Kohlberg’s also confirmed main findings (Rest, Narvaez et al 2000). Proponents of this neo-Kohlbrgian approach have detailed the role of moral structure in perceiving and interpreting moral issues, also the function of intermediate sized moral concepts and rationales that bring stage logic closer to real-life cases than universal principles do (Rest, Narvaez, Bebeau and Thoma 2000). Each year several large-scale cross-cultural studies are reported testing both Kohlbergian claims and the bias charges against them. The basic moral development sequence is verified in each (see New Research in Moral Development).

In light of such findings, philosophical critics must address a question too long delayed. If Kohlbergian stage theory is misguided and misconceived on major points, how do we explain the massive data accumulated over a half-decade that continuingly and surprisingly confirm its claims? After decades of methodological and conceptual criticism, why hasn't the depiction of moral development come close to being disconfirmed?

Critical theory can be tapped for an answer, viewing Kohlberg research as parroting the socialized ideologies of western (individualistic, male-dominated, industrialized-capitalist) societies, found in his socially brain-washed subjects. But this speaks to conceptual possibility. No competing account is offered. More, it suffers from far more of the empirical shortfalls and conceptual leaps attributed to Kohlberg by critics, condemning it by its own standards. Still, Kohlberg often warned followers not to take "those stages" too seriously. As a scientist he assumed that future research would change current findings. The depiction of moral development would be altered further when each domain of natural cognitive development was eventually integrated into a general theory of cognitive ego-development.

9. Caring's "Different Voice"

Of the more specific critiques coming from critical and cultural theory, one feminist-friendly version garnered most notice, especially outside research psychology. More noteworthy is the rare and rich alternative perspective on moral development that accompanied it: caring versus justice. Indeed, the caring theme offers an especially promising portrait of what benevolence ethics looks like on the practical level, in everyday life. As such it poses a far superior champion for the benevolence tradition than outsized views such as utilitarianism, or dated, intuitionist virtue theories. Feminism looks to virtue theory at its peril since, among other things, traditional trait theory has garnered very poor empirical backing. And the conceptualization of traditional virtues pre-dates both research psychology and the careful introspective or depth psychology that preceded it. The caring theme is researched as a set of interpretive skills and sensibilities, proclivities and habits, easily observed and verified. Further, caring is not only more realistic than its main virtue alternative, agape, but shows up such unconditional love as a kind of kindness-machismo.

Carol Gilligan (1982) argued that Kohlberg research, like Piagetian and Freudian research, reflected a male outlook on development. While occurring at the theoretical level, it also greatly infected Kohlbergian research methodology, making qualitative observations the fulfillment of prior ideological prophecy. The view of moral thinking and development that resulted—the "justice-and-rights orientation"--is over-abstracted, overly general and essentialistic. It focuses on foundational moral concepts only and on universal laws, not on a morality of social practice and interaction that its research claims to measure.. The moral orientation portrayed in Kohlbergian stages is rigid, formulaic or calculative, and legalistic. In personal life it is cold, aloof, and impersonal, if not manipulative and punitive. Its individualism urges contentiousness with vague threat of violence. These untoward qualities show in personal judgmentalism and blaming, in both social censure and legal punishment. But they also show in the demand-quality of rights-in-conflict, and in our restive resistance toward burdensome duties. Here, obligations are straightforwardly posed as moral burdens to be born, just as rights are cast as demands and “claims against” comrades. Responsibility is seen as diminishing free self expression when in care it is an opportunity for artful relation and fulfilling mutuality.

These observations on the coercive aspects of justice must strike a chord for ethicists, especially with Kantians who hold high the liberation of self-imposed moral laws. Vigilance against moralism within morality's midst is a constant for non-partisan ethics. Critical-feminist ethicists can only welcome the picture of rights and duties as clubs and shields in a battle of conflicting interests. What better fits the military model of human relations glimpsed in the masculinist "state of nature" and social contract myth underlying western ideology? Need ethics be designed for remote cooperation against mutually mistrustful and threatening strangers? Must it form an artificial bridge of relation where natural relational bonds are weak, and relational know how deficient? Or can it equally serve the needs of enhancing primary relations and spreading their scope as the expression of a natural “will-to-care?” (Noddings 1985).

Gilligan (and Noddings) argued for an unrecognized sub-theme in male moral development and a preferred and comparably valid theme among women, left out of Kohlberg's original research sample. This "care" theme focuses morality on skills of relationship—on supporting, nurturing, and being helpful, not on demanding, defending, requiring and compelling. Mature caring shows great competence in attending to others, in listening and responding sensitively to others through dialogue aimed at consensus. The inherent powers of relationship are rallied to address moral difficulties, not powers of individual ingenuity in problem solving or deliberative argumentation. As a goodness ethic, caring also emphasizes the sharing of aspirations, joys, accomplishments, and each other.

Relative to the unique longevity of the Kohlbergian program, care research remains in its infancy, as does its research methodology (Lyons, Brown, Argyris et. al. vol. 6). But even as a conceptual posit (a different voice hypothesis) care has proven extremely influential in hosts of fields spanning literature, domestic violence, leadership counseling and legal theory. It has garnered an array of serious critics in research psychology and theory (Walker, Maccoby & Greeno, Luria, Braebeck & Nunner-Winkler, Nichols, Tronto, Puka vol. 6), along with loyal devotees and defenders (Baumrind, Brown, Lyons Attanucci vol. 6). Care's very relevance to moral development remains unclear since almost no significant longitudinal research under-wrote the view originally, nor has much been added since. The three developmental levels depicted exactly parallel what Gilligan herself portrays as coping strategies—particular strategic responses to particular kinds of personal crises (Gilligan 1982, ch 4). Such phenomena differ great from general competence systems evolved for, and able at handling moral issues generally. Gilligan also depicts care levels in the format of Perryan meta-cognition, bearing more similarities to ethical and interpersonal meta-cognition than Piagetian first-order moral judgment. (Research does not show natural meta-cognitive development, apparently, in any domain, e.g., epistemological, ontological, scientific judgment, social, self-concept.). Gilligan also refers to care levels as cognitive orientations, not competence systems, which research also shows to be quite different cognitive phenomena (Perry 1968).

Indeed, care "levels" have been defended as wholly different phenomena from Kohlbergian levels or stages, despite being depicted for two decades as constituting a comparable and parallel developmental path (Brown and Tappan vol. 6). Gilligan seemingly favors the “different realities” portrayal from the outset, noting that care orientations are likely some undetermined mixture of biology, socialization, experience, reflection and cognitive construction. Indeed, they are an admitted function of masculinist, sexist socialization in part (Gilligan 1982, Intro, chs. 1 and 3). After their initial depiction, moreover, the developmental levels of caring have rarely received mention in the care literature.

To philosophers, however, placing the depictions of caring cognition alongside Kohlbergian stages points to a progressive sequence that such a benevolence ethic might take, naturally developing or not. As such, it suggests an educational curriculum that would foster current communitarian interest and cross-disciplinary feminism. The care ethic is of exceptional utility in the classroom, proving much more applicable for addressing real-world moral issues than any so-called applied ethic derived from moral philosophy or stage structure. Certainly mature care can be applied to moral issues more easily than Kohlberg's depiction of post-conventional moral reasoning. Students are struck by care’s preference for suspending judgment or making tentative and shaded judgments on moral difficulties that call out for interpersonal struggle and negotiation over time. For many, ethics seems too murky, and ethical problems too sparse on information to allow decisive, disjunctive solutions of a right-wrong, just-unjust variety.

10. Pedagogical Implications

Any developmental approach to education starts with this recognition: teachers are presenting ways to think to students who already have their own very competent ways to think. And students will use these ways of thinking to process the teacher's input. Moreover, many of the views being presented are intellectually refined versions of viewpoints the student has developed herself in more rudimentary forms. Thus classroom presentations must partner with a students’ current cognitive competence system. Their design must appeal to student views even when attempting to enhance and challenge those views, not aiming fill up empty space or reorganize badly filled space with something new or better.

Teachers who serve up material that is not geared to each student's acquired level of competence are "banging their head against a wall" to some extent. Worse, their lessons are “bouncing off”—being rejected as either incomprehensible or radically discordant with good sense. Or they are being distorted and misconceived to fit the student’s operating system. Enhancing the student’s ability to understand must work the opposite effect, urging the student’s terms of understanding to accommodate to the material’s structure, broadening its categories, adding distinct categories and interrelating them. For cognitive-moral developmentalists, this means presenting material that will unsettle current terms of understanding, urging students to construct new ones. Here the teacher can only get students to teach themselves and develop their own skills, as both psychology and ethics prescribe.

The stage or unified-system notion shows its power and utility most in this context. When philosophers present the range of post-conventional ethical or political theories in class, many students are processing them at a conventional level, thus systematically distorting them. They are not misunderstanding these views in a "factual" sense, but understanding them in different terms. This distortion is even greater when a less educated portion of the American public encounters teachings such as democratic toleration, equality before the law, separation of church and state and other constitutional principles.

Because stage structures are tightly integrated and encompassing--representing the basic meaning system of each student--class discussion also will have many students talking past each other in the same systematic sense. Arguments won by one party, or consensus achieved by two, may not at all be what it seems. Mutual miscommunication may be the rule here, not shared understanding. The same applies to citizens or voters in public discussion. Those parts of a discussion that end in greatest confusion, disagreement, and mutual dissatisfaction may be most educationally productive. And this is not simply because they provide food for reflective thought. Rather, at a deeper level, they may help initiate or exacerbate existing cognitive disequilibrium. And this will move a student toward the "accommodative reintegration" of her ideas in a higher level of understanding.

Likewise, a student whose paper is "a mess" of near-contradictory lines of thought, ad hoc rationales, and the like, may be showing a much greater degree of learning than one who presents a smooth and consistent rendering of ideas. The former student will confess, anxiously, that s/he got her or himself all mixed up, tied in knots, going this way and that. “I'm to the point where I understood the material far better when I first started.” Most likely, s/he is quite wrong. If teachers are not somehow urging and testing for such confusion and anxiety—for disequilibrated rather than equilibrated writing—they are likely falling short in enhancing fundamental student understanding. The same is true if they are not demanding the reconstruction of each student’s original and ongoing ideas in the face of challenges to them.

Many instructors likely will recognize the above phenomena in their teaching, finding this picture of them part-illuminating, part-affirming. Most ethics instructors are struck by their ability to uncover commonsense Aristotles, John Stuart Mills, Kants, Humes and Lockes in their classroom, merely by posing moral questions. Moral development findings provide a deep and systematic partial explanation of this phenomenon. Many instructors recognize that some students who "get views correct" don't have a very reflective grasp of them. Other who seem to get things wrong often are actually grappling at a much deeper level with the views. And most instructors can tell when some lectures or class discussions have no hope of getting anywhere. “The students’ minds just don’t seem open to this way of thinking.” Yes, this is precisely what developmental theory and stage unity would predict.

William Perry (1968) offers a quasi-developmental account of meta-cognitive thinking in the college years, including ethical reflection. Faculty find it useful for understanding special problems that students face when confronted with opposing conceptions of fact and value across the curriculum. For the philosopher, such confrontations occur frequently within each course. Perry's approach explicates the particular intellectual strategies students use when coping with conflicting fundamental theories. But it also indicates major shifts in student epistemic perspectives ranging from initial absolutism through a kind of relativistic functionalism. Because the account is as clinical as it is empirical in a research sense, it offers a insightful speculations on the emotions, motivations, and anxieties students experience in doing commonsense philosophy and ethics on their educational experience.

Nel Noddings (1995) poses mature caring as a model for reorganizing public schools. Students can be taught to care across the board—from the growing of plants in the classroom, through a kind of dialogue and coming to consensus with mathematical concepts, to the nurturing of friendships in class. But more, students can learn these lessons by being truly cared for by school personnel, not just respected or graded fairly. As a hospital aims to be a care-taking institution, so a school can conceive its overall mission that way, not simply transmitting education or developing student skills and the like, but supporting, nurturing, and partnering with students in every aspect of school life. That many school personnel mistakenly believe they are already doing this indicates how crucial it is to conceive care at higher developmental levels, with many differentiations and integrations, shadings and textures of adult caring given prominence. Conventional and post-conventional caring are quite different matters. Imagine what caring of this overall sort would look like in the usually anonymous setting of a college ethics course.

11. Related Research

The Kohlbergian approach to moral development has yielded hosts of cross-cultural studies bringing in the more developed cultural research methods of social anthropologists and creating some controversies regarding the issue of cultural relativism and universality (Sweder vol. 4, 7, Colby and Kohlberg 1987). Research on moral education, using Kohlberg research and theory, has taken several forms. Some measures the effects of discussing pointed moral dilemmas with students in the classroom, some measures the effect of creating "just communities" in which students can restructure their environment, making it more welcoming to morally sensitive reasoning.

The Kohlbergian approach also has spun of heretical research programs focused on the apparent development of moral conventions and traditions, independent of post-conventional reasoning development (Turiel vol. 2, 5), moral reflectivity, that occurs within seeming first-order moral judgment, not moving to the meta-cognitive level (Gibbs vol. 2), moral and political ideology, that often mires and masks moral reasoning within attitude schemes that bias its workings (Emler 1983), faith development that surprisingly mirrors moral cognition in its conceptualization of divinity and religious devotion (Fowler 1981, Oser 1980), and moral perception, one of several skills that enable the onset of moral deliberation, negotiation and reasoning (Rest, Narvaez, Bebeau & Thoma, 2000).

The Rest group offers a "four-component" model of ethical judgment that investigates many key components in true moral reasoning or problem solving, not clearly distinguished or investigated in Kohlbergian moral judgment. Narvaez has carried the moral perception component of this research to the classroom, assessing strategies for making students more sensitive to when morally-charged issues arise in daily life. She also has led attempts to integrate moral-development research with related cognitive science research on problem solving. Important new emphasis is being placed on non-deliberative aspects of moral judgment and “reasoning,” that show an immediate or automatic “rush to judgment.” These processes mark the typical, habitual way we handle routine moral decisions in daily life (Narvaez and Lapsley 2004 ).

Much research attention has been paid to the age-old problem of akrasia or weakness of will, termed the judgment-action gap by cognitive psychologists. The most progress in this area has been made by ego-developmentalists (Blasi 2004, Youniss & Damon vols. 2, 5). They suspect that our self-definitions—whether we view our sense of responsibility and character as central to who we are—most determine whether we practice what we moral preach. But many other factors seem involved, likely centered in moral emotions and attitudes, and the automaticity phenomena just noted. The important areas of moral motivation and emotion have proven the most difficult to get at empirically.

While not part of developmental research or theory, other specialties in psychology and philosophy frame moral-developmental concerns. Care research and feminist analysis can be seen in this way, as can Perry's meta-cognitive research above. Psychoanalysts have performed many interesting clinical studies on moral emotions and their motivational effects, focusing on superego functions (guilt, fear, shame, regret) and the ego-ideal (pride, emulation, aspiration, internalization). Enright (vol. 7) has conducted a remarkably enduring and progressive research program on forgiveness and its effects. Hoffman, as noted, has researched empathy most extensively.

For decades, social psychologists such as Adorno and Sherif have looked at issues of cooperation and competition, authoritarianism and democracy in various types of organizations and groups. They have developed an entire area of research, Pro-Social Development, which takes a basically amoral or non-moral look at all forms of socially conforming and contributing behavior. A formative, but largely abandoned research movement in this area investigated the conditions under which onlookers will help or fail to help strangers, accepting different costs or levels of risks for doing so (Bickman vol. 7). An industrial branch of social psychology looks at fairness issues in the workplace and the effects of greater and lesser employee control there. Damon has conducted myriad studies of fairness judgments in early childhood that point to many factors not taken covered by cognitive competence systems of their development. Related areas of personality psychology look into the motivations behind forms of moral altruism especially, trying to understand the concept of self-sacrifice and doing good for its own sake (Staub vol. 7). A very interesting program of altruism research rises directly from philosophical accounts of egoism, both psychological and ethical (Batson vol. 7).

Some of the most inspiring research in moral development charts the development and reflective motivations of everyday moral exemplars and heroes. Lawrence Blum (1988) offered important distinctions among types of extraordinarily moral individuals, which were incorporated into interview research and theory by Colby and Damon in Some Do Care. Lawrence Walker has begun a long-term research program in this area as well, which likely will help tie cognitive-moral development in education to the prominent character-education and moral-literacy movement. Character education focuses intently on the nurturing of admirable traits, attitudes, outlooks and value commitments. Without more extensive psychological research to support its traditionalist emphases on core American values, traditional virtues, and the upholding of codes and creeds, this approach flirts with the discredited approaches of early Anglo-American public school education, rife with moralistic strictures and nationalistic indoctrination.

12. References and Further Reading

The empirical research references above can be found in the seven volume series:

  • Moral Development: A Compendium. (1995). B. Puka (ed), Garland Press.
    • Classic research by Piaget and Kohlberg is contained in vols. 1 & 2 Defining Perspectives in Moral Development and Classic Research in Moral Development. Cross-cultural and updated longitudinal research is contained in vol. 5: New Research in Moral Development. Kohlberg criticism is highlighted in vol. 4: The Great Justice Debate. Care research by Gilligan and colleagues is highlighted in vol. 6: Caring Voices and Women's Moral Frames. Research on altruism, bystander intervention, egoism, and pro-social development is focused in vol. 7: Reaching Out.

Additional References:

  • Blasi, A (2004). "Moral functioning: Moral understanding and personality" In D. K. Lapsley and D. Narvaez (Eds.), Morality, Self, and Identity Mahwah, NJ: Erlbaum.
  • Blum, L. (1988) "Moral exemplars: Reflections on Schindler, the Trocmes and others". Midwestern studies in philosophy. XII.
  • Blum, L. (1980 ) Friendship, Altruism and Morality. Boston: Routledge Kegan-Paul.
  • Colby, A., Kohlberg, L., Speicher-Dubin, B, Hewer, A., Candee, D., Gibbs, & Power, C. (1987) The Measurement of Moral Judgment.
  • Colby,A. & Damon, W. (1993) Some Do Care. NY: Free Press.
  • Confucius. (1979). The Analects. New York: Penguin Classics.
  • Emler, N., Resnick, S. & Malone, B. (1982). "The relationship between moral rasoning and political orientation". Journal of Personality and Social Psychology, 45 1073-1080.
  • Fowler, J. (1981). Stages of Faith. San Francisco: Harper and Row.
  • Gilligan, C. (1982). In a Different Voice. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Kohlberg, L. (1981). Essays in Moral Development: The Philosophy of Moral Development. (1984). The Psychology of Moral Development. New York: Harper and Row.
  • Narvaez, D. & Lapsley, D (2004, in press) S. Bend, Indiana: Notre Dame University Press.
  • Noddings, N. (1985). Caring: A Feminine Approach to Ethics and Moral Education. Los Angeles: University of California Press Press.
  • Noddings, N. (1995). The Challenge to Care in the Schools. Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • Oser, F. (1980). Stages if religious judgment. In J. Fowler and A. Vergote (eds.) Toward Moral and Religious Maturity. Morristonw, NJ: Silver Burdett.
  • Perry, W. (1968). Forms of Intellectual and Ethical Development During the College Years. New York: Rinehart & Winston.
  • Puka, B. (1980). Toward Moral Perfectionism. NY: Garland Press.
  • Rawls, J (1971). A Theory of Justice. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press. Rest. J. Narvaez, D., Thoma, S and Bebeau, M. Post-Conventional Moral Reasoning: A Neo-Kohlbergian Approach (2000). Mahway, NJ: Erlbaum Press..
  • Salovey, P. & Mayer, J.D. (1990). "Emotional intelligence," Imagination, Cognition, and Personality 9 185-211.

Author Information

William Puka
Rensselaer Polytechnic Institute
U. S. A.

Dualism and Mind

Dualists in the philosophy of mind emphasize the radical difference between mind and matter. They all deny that the mind is the same as the brain, and some deny that the mind is wholly a product of the brain. This article explores the various ways that dualists attempt to explain this radical difference between the mental and the physical world. A wide range of arguments for and against the various dualistic options are discussed.

Substance dualists typically argue that the mind and the body are composed of different substances and that the mind is a thinking thing that lacks the usual attributes of physical objects: size, shape, location, solidity, motion, adherence to the laws of physics, and so on. Substance dualists fall into several camps depending upon how they think mind and body are related. Interactionists believe that minds and bodies causally affect one another. Occasionalists and parallelists, generally motivated by a concern to preserve the integrity of physical science, deny this, ultimately attributing all apparent interaction to God. Epiphenomenalists offer a compromise theory, asserting that bodily events can have mental events as effects while denying that the reverse is true, avoiding any threat to the scientific law of conservation of energy at the expense of the common sense notion that we act for reasons.

Property dualists argue that mental states are irreducible attributes of brain states. For the property dualist, mental phenomena are non-physical properties of physical substances. Consciousness is perhaps the most widely recognized example of a non-physical property of physical substances. Still other dualists argue that mental states, dispositions and episodes are brain states, although the states cannot be conceptualized in exactly the same way without loss of meaning.

Dualists commonly argue for the distinction of mind and matter by employing Leibniz's Law of Identity, according to which two things are identical if, and only if, they simultaneously share exactly the same qualities. The dualist then attempts to identify attributes of mind that are lacked by matter (such as privacy or intentionality) or vice versa (such as having a certain temperature or electrical charge). Opponents typically argue that dualism is (a) inconsistent with known laws or truths of science (such as the aforementioned law of thermodynamics), (b) conceptually incoherent (because immaterial minds could not be individuated or because mind-body interaction is not humanly conceivable), or (c) reducible to absurdity (because it leads to solipsism, the epistemological belief that one's self is the only existence that can be verified and known).

Table of Contents

  1. Dualism
  2. Platonic Dualism in the Phaedo
    1. The Argument From Opposites
    2. The Argument From Recollection
    3. The Argument From Affinity
    4. Criticisms of the Platonic Arguments
  3. Descartes' Dualism
    1. The Argument From Indivisibility
    2. Issues Raised by the Indivisibility Argument
    3. The Argument From Indubitability
    4. The Real Distinction Argument
  4. Other Leibniz's Law Arguments for Dualism
    1. Privacy and First Person Authority
    2. Intentionality
    3. Truth and Meaning
    4. Problems with Leibniz's Law Arguments for Dualism
  5. The Free Will and Moral Arguments
  6. Property Dualism
  7. Objections to Dualism Motivated by Scientific Considerations
    1. Arguments from Human Development
    2. The Conservation of Energy Argument
    3. Problems of Interaction
    4. The Correlation and Dependence Arguments
  8. The Problem of Other Minds
  9. Criticisms of the Mind as a Thinking Thing
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Dualism

The most basic form of dualism is substance dualism, which requires that mind and body be composed of two ontologically distinct substances. The term "substance" may be variously understood, but for our initial purposes we may subscribe to the account of a substance, associated with D. M. Armstrong, as what is logically capable of independent existence. (Armstrong, 1968, p. 7). According to the dualist, the mind (or the soul) is comprised of a non-physical substance, while the body is constituted of the physical substance known as matter. According to most substance dualists, mind and body are capable of causally affecting each other. This form of substance dualism is known as interactionism.

Two other forms of substance dualism are occasionalism and parallelism. These theories are largely relics of history. The occasionalist holds that mind and body do not interact. They may seem to when, for example, we hit our thumb with a hammer and a painful and distressing sensation occurs. Occassionalists, like Malebranche, assert that the sensation is not caused by the hammer and nerves, but instead by God. God uses the occasion of environmental happenings to create appropriate experiences.

According to the parallelist, our mental and physical histories are coordinated so that mental events appear to cause physical events (and vice versa) by virtue of their temporal conjunction, but mind and body no more interact than two clocks that are synchronized so that the one chimes when hands of the other point out the new hour. Since this fantastic series of harmonies could not possibly be due to mere coincidence, a religious explanation is advanced. God does not intervene continuously in creation, as the occasionalist holds, but builds into creation a pre-established harmony that largely eliminates the need for future interference.

Another form of dualism is property dualism. Property dualists claim that mental phenomena are non-physical properties of physical phenomena, but not properties of non-physical substances. Some forms of epiphenomenalism fall into this category. According to epiphenomenalism, bodily events or processes can generate mental events or processes, but mental phenomena do not cause bodily events or processes (or, on some accounts, anything at all, including other mental states). (McLaughlin, p. 277) Whether an epiphenomenalist thinks these mental epiphenomena are properties of the body or properties of a non-physical mental medium determines whether the epiphenomenalist is a property or substance dualist.

Still other dualists hold not that mind and body are distinct ontologically, but our mentalistic vocabulary cannot be reduced to a physicalistic vocabulary. In this sort of dualism, mind and body are conceptually distinct, though the phenomena referred to by mentalistic and physicalistic terminology are coextensive.

The following sections first discuss dualism as expounded by two of its primary defenders, Plato and Descartes. This is followed by additional arguments for and against dualism, with special emphasis on substance dualism, the historically most important and influential version of dualism.

2. Platonic Dualism in the Phaedo

The primary source for Plato's views on the metaphysical status of the soul is the Phaedo, set on the final day of Socrates' life before his self-administered execution. Plato (through the mouth of Socrates, his dramatic persona) likens the body to a prison in which the soul is confined. While imprisoned, the mind is compelled to investigate the truth by means of the body and is incapable (or severely hindered) of acquiring knowledge of the highest, eternal, unchanging, and non-perceptible objects of knowledge, the Forms. Forms are universals and represent the essences of sensible particulars. While encumbered by the body, the soul is forced to seek truth via the organs of perception, but this results in an inability to comprehend that which is most real. We perceive equal things, but not Equality itself. We perceive beautiful things but not Beauty itself. To achieve knowledge or insight into the pure essences of things, the soul must itself become pure through the practice of philosophy or, as Plato has Socrates provocatively put it in the dialogue, through practicing dying while still alive. The soul must struggle to disassociate itself from the body as far as possible and turn its attention toward the contemplation of intelligible but invisible things. Though perfect understanding of the Forms is likely to elude us in this life (if only because the needs of the body and its infirmities are a constant distraction), knowledge is available to pure souls before and after death, which is defined as the separation of the soul from the body.

a. The Argument From Opposites

Plato's Phaedo contains several arguments in support of his contention that the soul can exist without the body. According to the first of the Phaedo's arguments, the Argument from Opposites, things that have an opposite come to be from their opposite. For example, if something comes to be taller, it must come to be taller from having been shorter; if something comes to be heavier, it must come to be so by first having been lighter. These processes can go in either direction. That is, things can become taller, but they also can become shorter; things can become sweeter, but also more bitter. In the Phaedo, Socrates notes that we awaken from having been asleep and go to sleep from having been awake. Similarly, since dying comes from living, living must come from dying. Thus, we must come to life again after we die. During the interim between death and rebirth the soul exists apart from the body and has the opportunity to glimpse the Forms unmingled with matter in their pure and undiluted fullness. Death liberates the soul, greatly increasing its apprehension of truth. As such, the philosophical soul is unafraid to die and indeed looks forward to death as to liberation.

b. The Argument From Recollection

A second argument from the Phaedo is the Argument from Recollection. Socrates argues that the soul must exist prior to birth because we can recollect things that could not have been learned in this life. For example, according to Socrates we realize that equal things can appear to be unequal or can be equal in some respects but not others. People can disagree about whether two sticks are equal. They may disagree about if they are equal in length, weight, color, or even whether they are equally "sticks." The Form of Equality—Equality Itself—can never be or appear unequal. According to Socrates, we recognize that the sticks are unequal and that they are striving to be equal but are nevertheless deficient in terms of their equality. Now, if we can notice that the sticks are unequal, we must comprehend what Equality is. Just as I could not recognize that a portrait was a poor likeness of your grandfather unless I already knew what your grandfather looked like, I cannot reccognize that the sticks are unequal by means of the senses, without an understanding of the Form of Equality. We begin to perceive at birth or shortly thereafter. Hence, the soul must have existed prior to birth. It existed before it acquires a body. (A similar argument is developed in Plato's Meno (81a-86b).

c. The Argument From Affinity

A third argument from the Phaedo is the Argument from Affinity. Socrates claims that things that are composite are more liable to be destroyed than things that are simple. The Forms are true unities and therefore least likely ever to be annihilated. Socrates then posits that invisible things such as Forms are not apt to be disintegrated, whereas visible things, which all consist of parts, are susceptible to decay and corruption. Since the body is visible and composite, it is subject to decomposition. The soul, on the other hand, is invisible. The soul also becomes like the Forms if it is steadfastly devoted to their consideration and purifies itself by having no more association with the body than necessary. Since the invisible things are the durable things, the soul, being invisible, must outlast the body. Further, the philosophical soul, that becomes Form-like, is immortal and survives the death of the body.

d. Criticisms of the Platonic Arguments

Some of these arguments are challenged even in the Phaedo itself by Socrates' friends Simmias and Cebes and the general consensus among modern philosophers is that the arguments fail to establish the immortality of the soul and its independence and separability from the body. (Traces of the Affinity argument in a more refined form will be observed in Descartes below). The Argument from Opposites applies only to things that have an opposite and, as Aristotle notes, substances have no contraries. Further, even if life comes from what is itself not alive, it does not follow that the living human comes from the union of a dead (i.e. separated) soul and a body. The principle that everything comes to be from its opposite via a two-directional process cannot hold up to critical scrutiny. Although one becomes older from having been younger, there is no corresponding reverse process leading the older to become younger. If aging is a uni-directional process, perhaps dying is as well. Cats and dogs come to be from cats and dogs, not from the opposites of these (if they have opposites). The Arguments from Recollection and Affinity, on the other hand, presuppose the existence of Forms and are therefore no more secure than the Forms themselves (as Socrates notes in the Phaedo at 76d-e).

We turn now to Descartes' highly influential defense of dualism in the early modern period.

3. Descartes' Dualism

The most famous philosophical work of René Descartes is the Meditations on First Philosophy (1641). In the Sixth Meditation, Descartes calls the mind a thing that thinks and not an extended thing. He defines the body as an extended thing and not a thing that thinks (1980, p. 93). "But what then am I? A thing that thinks. What is that? A thing that doubts, understands, affirms, denies, wills, refuses, and which also imagines and senses." (1980, p. 63). He expands on the notion of extension in the Fifth Meditation saying, "I enumerate the [extended] thing's various parts. I ascribe to these parts certain sizes, shapes, positions, and movements from place to place; to these movements I ascribe various durations" (1980, p. 85). Bodies, but not minds, are describable by predicates denoting entirely quantifiable qualities and hence bodies are fit objects for scientific study.

Having thus supplied us with the meanings of "mind" and "body," Descartes proceeds to state his doctrine: "I am present to my body not merely in the way a seaman is present to his ship, but . . . I am tightly joined and, so to speak, mingled together with it, so much so that I make up one single thing with it" (1980, p. 94). The place where this "joining" was believed by Descartes to be especially true was the pineal gland—the seat of the soul. "Although the soul is joined to the whole body, there is yet in the body a certain part in which it seems to exercise its functions more specifically than in all the others. . . I seem to find evidence that the part of the body in which the soul exercises its functions immediately is. . . solely the innermost part of the brain, namely, a certain very small gland." (1952, p. 294). When we wish to "move the body in any manner, this volition causes the gland to impel the spirits towards the muscles which bring about this effect" (1952, p. 299). Conversely, the body is also able to influence the soul. Light reflected from the body of an animal and entering through our two eyes "form but one image on the gland, which, acting immediately on the soul, causes it to see the shape of the animal." (1952, p. 295-96).

It is clear, then, that Descartes held to a form of interactionism, believing that mental events can sometimes cause bodily events and that bodily events can sometimes cause mental events. (This reading of Descartes-as-interactionist has recently been challenged. See Baker and Morris (1996). Also, Daniel Garber suggests that Descartes is a quasi-occasionalist, permitting minds to act on bodies, but invoking God to explain the actions of inanimate bodies on each other and phenomena where bodies act on minds, such as sensation. See Garber, 2001, ch. 10).

a. The Argument From Indivisibility

Descartes' primary metaphysical justification of the distinction of mind and body is the Argument from Indivisibility. He writes, "there is a great difference between a mind and a body, because the body, by its very nature, is something divisible, whereas the mind is plainly indivisible. . . insofar as I am only a thing that thinks, I cannot distinguish any parts in me. . . . Although the whole mind seems to be united to the whole body, nevertheless, were a foot or an arm or any other bodily part amputated, I know that nothing would be taken away from the mind. . ." (1980, p. 97). Decartes argues that the mind is indivisible because it lacks extension. The body, as an object that takes up space, can always be divided (at least conceptually), whereas the mind is simple and non-spatial. Since the mind and body have different attributes, they must not be the same thing, their "unity" notwithstanding.

This Indivisibility Argument makes use of Leibniz's Law of Identity: two things are the same if, and only if, they have all of the same properties at the same time. More formally, x is identical to y if, and only if, for any property p had by x at time t, y also has p at t, and vice versa. Descartes uses Leibniz's Law to show that the mind and body are not identical because they do not have all of the same properties. An illustration (for present purposes a property can be considered anything that may be predicated of a subject): If the man with the martini is the mayor, it must be possible to predicate all and only the same properties of both "the man" and "the mayor," including occupying (or having bodies that occupy) the same exact spatial location at the same time.

Since divisibility may be predicated of bodies (and all of their parts, such as brains) and may not be predicated of minds, Leibniz's Law suggests that minds cannot be identical to bodies or any of their parts or systems. Although it makes sense to speak of the left or right half of the brain, it makes no sense to speak of half of a desire, several pieces of a headache, part of joy, or two-thirds of a belief. What is true of mental states is held to be true of the mind that has the states as well. In the synopsis of the Meditations, Descartes writes, "we cannot conceive of half a soul, as we can in the case of any body, however small." (1980, p. 52). The mind has many ideas, but they are all ideas of one indivisible mind.

b. Issues Raised by the Indivisibility Argument

John Locke argued that awareness is rendered discontinuous by intervals of sleep, anesthesia, or unconsciousness. (Bk.II, ch.I, sect.10). Is awareness then divisible? Locke suggests that the mind cannot exhibit temporal discontinuity and also have thought as its essence. But even if Descartes was wrong to consider the mind an essentially thinking thing, the concept of mind is not reduced to vacuity if some other, positive characteristic can be found by which to define it. But what might that be? (Without some such means of characterizing the mind it would be defined entirely negatively and we would have no idea what it is).

Against Locke, Dualists can argue in several ways. (1) That the mind has both conscious and unconscious thoughts and that Locke's argument shows only that the mind is not always engaged in conscious reflection, though it may be perpetually busy at the unconscious level. Locke argues that such a maneuver creates grave difficulties for personal identity (Bk.II, Ch.I, sect.11), however, and denies that thoughts can exist unperceived. (2) Dualists can argue that the soul always thinks, but that the memory fails to preserve those thoughts when asleep or under anesthesia. (3) Dualists can argue that the Lockean observation is not relevant to the Argument from Indivisibility because the discontinuity Locke identifies in consciousness is not a spatial discontinuity but a temporal one. The Argument from Indivisibility seeks to show that bodies but not minds are spatially divisible and that argument is not rebutted by pointing out that consciousness is temporally divisible. (Indeed, if minds are temporally divisible and bodies are not, we have an argument for dualism of a different sort).

David Hume, on the other hand, questioned of what the unity of consciousness might consist. The Indivisibility Argument suggests that the mind is a simple unity. Hume finds no reason to grant or assume that the diversity of our experiences (whether visual perception, pain or active thinking and mathematical apprehension) constitute a unity rather than a diversity. For Hume, all introspection reveals is the presence of various impressions and ideas, but does not reveal a subject in which those ideas inhere. Accordingly, if observation is to yield knowledge of the self, the self can consist in nothing but a bundle of perceptions. Even talk of a "bundle" is misleading if that suggests an empirically discoverable internal unity. Thus, Descartes' commitment to a res cogitans or thing which thinks is unfounded and substance dualism is undermined. (For a contrary view on what constitutes the unity of the self, see Madell's view that, "What unites all of my experiences…is simply that they all have the irreducible and unanalyzable property of 'mineness,'" in Nagel, 1986, p. 34, n. 5).

Immanuel Kant replied to Hume that we must suppose or posit the unity of the ego (which he called the "transcendental unity of apperception") as a preliminary to all experience since without such a unity the manifold of sense-data (or "sensibility") could not constitute, for example, the experience of seeing a clock. However, Kant agreed that we must not mistake the unity of apperception for the perception of unity—that is, the perception of a unitary thing or substance. Kant also argued that there is little reason to suppose that the mind or ego cannot be destroyed despite its unity since its powers may gradually attenuate to the point where they simply fade away. The mind need not be separated into non-physical granules to be destroyed since it can suffer a kind of death through loss of its powers. Awareness, perception, memory and the like admit of degrees. If the degree of consciousness decreases to zero, then the mind is effectively annihilated. Even if, as Plato and Descartes agree, the mind is not divisible, it does not follow that it survives (or could survive) separation from the body. Additionally, if the mind is neither physical nor identical to its inessential characteristics (1980, p. 53), it is impossible to distinguish one mind from another. Kant argues that two substances that are otherwise identical can be differentiated only by their spatial locations. If minds are not differentiated by their contents and have no spatial positions to distinguish them, there remains no basis for individuating their identities. (On numerically individuating non-physical substances, see Armstrong, 1968, pp. 27-29. For a general discussion of whether the self is a substance, see Shoemaker, 1963, ch. 2).

c. The Argument From Indubitability

Descartes' other major argument for dualism in the Meditations derives from epistemological considerations. After taking up his celebrated method of doubt, which commits him to reject as false anything that is in the slightest degree uncertain, Descartes finds that the entirety of the physical world is uncertain. Perhaps, after all, it is nothing but an elaborate phantasm wrought by an all-powerful and infinitely clever, but deceitful, demon. Still, he cannot doubt his own existence, since he must exist to doubt. Because he thinks, he is. But he cannot be his body, since that identity is doubtful and possibly altogether false. Therefore, he is a non-bodily "thinking thing," or mind. As Richard Rorty puts it: "If we look in Descartes for a common factor which pains, dreams, memory-images, and veridical and hallucinatory perceptions share with concepts of (and judgments about) God, number, and the ultimate constituents of matter, we find no explicit doctrine. . . . The answer I would give to the question 'What did Descartes find?' is 'Indubitability'" (1979 p. 54). In sum, I cannot doubt the existence of my mind, but I can doubt the existence of my body. Since what I cannot doubt cannot be identical to what I can doubt (by Leibniz's Law), mind and body are not identical and dualism is established.

This argument is also featured in Descartes' Discourse on Method part four: "[S]eeing that I could pretend that I had no body and that there was no world nor any place where I was, but that I could not pretend, on that account, that I did not exist; and that, on the contrary, from the very fact that I thought about doubting the truth of other things, it followed very evidently and very certainly that I existed. . . . From this I knew that I was a substance the whole essence or nature of which was merely to think, and which, in order to exist, needed no place and depended on no material things. Thus this 'I,' that is, the soul through which I am what I am, is entirely distinct from the body. . ." (1980, p. 18).

The Argument from Indubitability has been maligned in the philosophical literature from the very beginning. Most famously, Arnauld comments in the objections originally published with the Meditations that, "Just as a man errs in not believing that the equality of the square on its base to the squares on its sides belongs to the nature of that triangle, which he clearly and distinctly knows to be right angled, so why am I perhaps not in the wrong in thinking that nothing else belongs to my nature which I clearly and distinctly know to be something that thinks, except that fact that I am this thinking being? Perhaps it also belongs to my essence to be something extended." (1912, p. 84). Suppose that I cannot doubt whether a given figure is a triangle, but can doubt whether its interior angles add up to two right angles. It does not follow from this that the number of degrees in triangles may be more or less than 180. This is because the doubt concerning the number of degrees in a triangle is a property of me, not of triangles. Similarly, I may doubt that my body is not a property of my body, believing it to be a property of whatever part of me it is that doubts, and that "whatever" may be something extended.

The dualist can reply in two ways. First, he or she may argue that, while doubting the body is not a property of bodies, being doubtable is a property of bodies. Since bodies have the property of being doubtable, and minds do not, by Leibniz's Law the diversity of the two is established. Second, the dualist may reply that it is always possible to doubt whether the figure before me is a triangle. As such, Arnauld's supposedly parallel argument is not parallel at all. Similar objections are open against other, more recent rebuttals to Descartes' argument. Consider, for example, the following parallel argument from Paul Churchland (1988, p. 32): I cannot doubt that Mohammed Ali was a famous heavyweight boxer but can doubt that Cassius Clay was a famous heavyweight boxer. Following Descartes, it ought to be that Ali is not Clay (though in fact Clay was a famous heavyweight and identical to Ali). By way of reply, surely it is possible for an evil demon to deceive me about whether Mohammed Ali was a famous heavyweight boxer. So, the dualist might insist, the case of mind is unique in its immunity from doubt. It is only with reference to our own mental states that we can be said to know incorrigibly.

d. The Real Distinction Argument

A third argument in the Meditations maintains that the mind and body must really be separate because Descartes can conceive of the one without the other. Since he can clearly and distinctly understand the body without the mind and vice versa, God could really have created them separately. But if the mind and body can exist independently, they must really be independent, for nothing can constitute a part of the essence of a thing that can be absent without the thing itself ceasing to be. If the essence of the mind is incorporeal, so must be the mind itself.

4. Other Leibniz's Law Arguments for Dualism

a. Privacy and First Person Authority

As noted earlier, dualists have argued for their position by employing Leibniz's Law in many ingenious ways. The general strategy is to identify some property or feature indisputably had by mental phenomena but not attributable in any meaningful way to bodily or nervous phenomena, or vice versa. For example, some have suggested that mental states are private in the sense that only those who possess them can know them directly. If I desire an apple, I know that I have this desire "introspectively." Others can know of my desire only by means of my verbal or non-verbal behavior or, conceivably, by inspection of my brain. (The latter assumes a correlation, if not an identity, between nervous and mental states or events). My linguistic, bodily and neural activities are public in the sense that anyone suitably placed can observe them. Since mental states are private to their possessors, but brain states are not, mental states cannot be identical to brain states. (Rey pp. 55-56).

A closely related argument emphasizes that my own mental states are knowable without inference; I know them "immediately." (Harman, 1973, pp. 35-37). Others can know my mental states only by making inferences based on my verbal, non-verbal or neurophysiological activity. You may infer that I believe it will rain from the fact that I am carrying an umbrella, but I do not infer that I believe it will rain from noticing that I am carrying an umbrella. I do not need to infer my mental states because I know them immediately. Since mental states are knowable without inference in the first person case, but are knowable (or at least plausibly assigned) only by inference in the third person case, we have an authority or incorrigibility with reference to our own mental states that no one else could have. Since beliefs about the physical world are always subject to revision (our inferences or theories could be mistaken), mental states are not physical states.

b. Intentionality

Some mental states exhibit intentionality. Intentional mental states include, but are not limited to, intendings, such as plans to buy milk at the store. They are states that are about, of, for, or towards things other than themselves. Desires, beliefs, loves, hates, perceptions and memories are common intentional states. For example, I may have a desire for an apple; I may have love for or towards my neighbor; I may have a belief about republicans or academics; or I may have memories of my grandfather.

The dualist claims that brain states, however, cannot plausibly be ascribed intentionality. How can a pattern of neural firings be of or about or towards anything other than itself? As a purely physical event, an influx of sodium ions through the membrane of a neural cell creating a polarity differential between the inside and outside of the cell wall, and hence an electrical discharge, cannot be of Paris, about my grandfather, or for an apple. [Although Brentano goes further than most contemporary philosophers in regarding all mental phenomena as intentional, he argues that "the reference to something as an object is a distinguishing characteristic of all mental phenomena. No physical phenomena exhibits anything similar." (Brentano, 1874/1973, p. 97, quoted in Rey, 1997, p. 23).] Thus, by Leibniz's Law, if minds are capable of intentional states and bodies are not, minds and bodies must be distinct. (Taylor, pp. 11-12; Rey pp. 57-59).

c. Truth and Meaning

Another attempt to derive dualism by means of Leibniz's Law observes that some mental states, especially beliefs, have truth-values. My belief that it will rain can be either true or false. But, the dualist may urge, as a purely physical event, an electrical or chemical discharge in the brain cannot be true or false. Indeed, it lacks not only truth, but also linguistic meaning. Since mental states such as beliefs possess truth-value and semantics, it seems incoherent to attribute these properties to bodily states. Thus, mental states are not bodily states. Presumably, then, the minds that have these states are also non-physical. (Churchland, 1988, p. 30; Taylor, 1983, p. 12).

d. Problems with Leibniz's Law Arguments for Dualism

Although each of these arguments for dualism may be criticized individually, they are typically thought to share a common flaw: they assume that because some aspect of mental states, such as privacy, intentionality, truth, or meaning cannot be attributed to physical substances, they must be attributable to non-physical substances. But if we do not understand how such states and their properties can be generated by the central nervous system, we are no closer to understanding how they might be produced by minds. (Nagel, 1986, p. 29). The question is not, "How do brains generate mental states that can only be known directly by their possessors?" Rather, the relavent question is "How can any such thing as a substance, of whatever sort, do these things?" The mystery is as great when we posit a mind as the basis of these operations or capacities as when we attribute them to bodies. Dualists cannot explain the mechanisms by which souls generate meaning, truth, intentionality or self-awareness.Thus, dualism creates no explanatory advantage. As such, we should use Ockham's razor to shave off the spiritual substance, because we ought not to multiply entities beyond what is necessary to explain the phenomena. Descartes' prodigious doubt notwithstanding, we have excellent reasons for thinking that bodies exist. If the only reasons for supposing that non-physical minds exist are the phenomena of intentionality, privacy and the like, then dualism unnecessarily complicates the metaphysics of personhood.

On the other hand, dualists commonly argue that it makes no sense to attribute some characteristics of body to mind; that to do so is to commit what Gilbert Ryle called a "category mistake." For example, it makes perfect sense to ask where the hypothalamus is, but not, in ordinary contexts, to ask where my beliefs are. We can ask how much the brain weighs, but not how much the mind weighs. We can ask how many miles per hour my body is moving, but not how many miles per hour my mind is moving. Minds are just not the sorts of things that can have size, shape, weight, location, motion, and the other attributes that Descartes ascribes to extended reality. We literally could not understand someone who informed us that the memories of his last holiday are two inches behind the bridge of his nose or that his perception of the color red is straight back from his left eye. If these claims are correct, then some Leibniz's Law arguments for dualism are not obviously vulnerable to the critique above.

5. The Free Will and Moral Arguments

Another argument for dualism claims that dualism is required for free will. If dualism is false, then presumably materialism, the thesis that humans are entirely physical beings, is true. (We set aside consideration of idealism—the thesis that only minds and ideas exist). If materialism were true, then every motion of bodies should be determined by the laws of physics, which govern the actions and reactions of everything in the universe. But a robust sense of freedom presupposes that we are free, not merely to do as we please, but that we are free to do otherwise than as we do. This, in turn, requires that the cause of our actions not be fixed by natural laws. Since, according to the dualist, the mind is non-physical, there is no need to suppose it bound by the physical laws that govern the body. So, a strong sense of free will is compatible with dualism but incompatible with materialism. Since freedom in just this sense is required for moral appraisal, the dualist can also argue that materialism, but not dualism, is incompatible with ethics. (Taylor, 1983, p. 11; cf. Rey, 1997, pp. 52-53). This, the dualist may claim, creates a strong presumption in favor of their metaphysics.

This argument is sometimes countered by arguing that free will is actually compatible with materialism or that even if the dualistic account of the will is correct, it is irrelevant because no volition on the part of a non-physical substance could alter the course of nature anyway. As Bernard Williams puts it, "Descartes' distinction between two realms, designed to insulate responsible human action from mechanical causation, insulated the world of mechanical causation, that is to say, the whole of the external world, from responsible human action. Man would be free only if there was nothing he could do." (1966, p. 7). Moreover, behaviorist opponents argue that if dualism is true, moral appraisal is meaningless since it is impossible to determine another person's volitions if they are intrinsically private and otherworldly.

6. Property Dualism

Property dualists claim that mental phenomena are non-physical properties of physical phenomena, but not properties of non-physical substances. Property dualists are not committed to the existence of non-physical substances, but are committed to the irreducibility of mental phenomena to physical phenomena.

An argument for property dualism, derived from Thomas Nagel and Saul Kripke, is as follows: We can assert that warmth is identical to mean kinetic molecular energy, despite appearances, by claiming that warmth is how molecular energy is perceived or manifested in consciousness. Minds detect molecular energy by experiencing warmth; warmth "fixes the reference" of heat. ("Heat" is a rigid designator of molecular motion; "the sensation of heat" is a non-rigid designator.) Similarly, color is identical to electromagnetic reflectance efficiencies, inasmuch as color is how electromagnetic wavelengths are processed by human consciousness. In these cases, the appearance can be distinguished from the reality. Heat is molecular motion, though it appears to us as warmth. Other beings, for example, Martians, might well apprehend molecular motion in another fashion. They would grasp the same objective reality, but by correlating it with different experiences. We move toward a more objective understanding of heat when we understand it as molecular energy rather than as warmth. in our case, or as whatever it appears to them to be in theirs. Consciousness itself, however, cannot be reduced to brain activity along analogous lines because we should then need to say that consciousness is how brain activity is perceived in consciousness, leaving consciousness unreduced. Put differently, when it comes to consciousness, the appearance is the reality. Therefore, no reduction is possible. Nagel writes:

Experience . . . does not seem to fit the pattern. The idea of moving from appearance to reality seems to make no sense here. What is the analogue in this case to pursuing a more objective understanding of the same phenomena by abandoning the initial subjective viewpoint toward them in favor of another that is more objective but concerns the same thing? Certainly it appears unlikely that we will get closer to the real nature of human experience by leaving behind the particularity of our human point of view and striving for a description in terms accessible to beings that could not imagine what it was like to be us. (Nagel 1974; reprinted in Block et. al. p. 523).

Consciousness is thus sui generis (of its own kind), and successful reductions elsewhere should give us little confidence when it comes to experience.

Some property dualists, such as Jaegwon Kim, liken "having a mind" to "a property, capacity, or characteristic that humans and some higher animals possess in contrast with things like pencils and rocks. . . . Mentality is a broad and complex property." (Kim, 1996, p. 5). Kim continues: "[Some properties] are physical, like having a certain mass or temperature, being 1 meter long, and being heavier than. Some things—in particular, persons and certain biological organisms—can also instantiate mental properties, like being in pain and liking the taste of avocado." (p. 6). Once we admit the existence of mental properties, we can inquire into the nature of the relationship between mental and physical properties. According to the supervenience thesis, there can be no mental differences without corresponding physical differences. If, for example, I feel a headache, there must be some change not only in my mental state, but also in my body (presumably, in my brain). If Mary is in pain, but Erin is not, then, according to the supervenience thesis, there must be a physical difference between Mary and Erin. For example, Mary's c-fibers are firing and Erin's are not. If this is true, it is possible to argue for a type of property dualism by arguing that some mental states or properties, especially the phenomenal aspects of consciousness, do not "supervene on" physical states or properties in regular, lawlike ways. (Kim, p. 169).

Why deny supervenience? Because it seems entirely conceivable that there could exist a twin Earth where all of the physical properties that characterize the actual world are instantiated and are interrelated as they are here, but where the inhabitants are "zombies" without experience, or where the inhabitants have inverted qualia relative to their true-Earth counterparts. If it is possible to have mental differences without physical differences, then mental properties cannot be identical to or reducible to physical properties. They would exist as facts about the world over and above the purely physical facts. Put differently, it always makes sense to wonder "why we exist and not zombies." (Chalmers, 1996, p. 110). (Kim, 169 and following.; Kripke, 1980, throughout; Chalmers, 1996, throughout, but esp. chs. 3 & 4).

Some have attempted to rebut this "conceivability argument" by noting that the fact that we can ostensibly imagine such a zombie world does not mean that it is possible. Without the actual existence of such a world, the argument that mental properties do not supervene on physical properties fails.

A second rebuttal avers that absent qualia thought experiments (and inverted spectra though experiments) only support property dualism if we can imagine these possibilities obtaining. Perhaps we think we can conceive a zombie world, when we really can't. We may think we can conceive of such a world but attempts to do so do not actually achieve such a conception.

To illustrate, suppose that Goldbach's Conjecture is true. If it is, its truth is necessary. If, then, someone thought that they imagined a proof that the thesis is false, they would be conceiving the falsity of what is in reality a necessary truth. This is implausible. What we should rather say in such a case is that the person was mistaken, and that what they imagined false was not Goldbach's Conjecture after all, or that the "proof" that was imagined was in fact no proof, or that what they were really imagining was something like an excited mathematician shouting, "Eureka! So it's false then!" Perhaps it is likewise when we "conceive" a zombie universe. We may be mistaken about what it is that we are actually "picturing" to ourselves. Against this objection, however, one could argue that there are independent grounds for thinking that the truth-value of Goldbach's theorem is necessary and no independent reasons for thinking that Zombie worlds are impossible; therefore, the dualist deserves the benefit of the doubt.

But perhaps the physicalist can come up with independent reasons for supposing that the dualist has failed to imagine what she claims. The physicalist can point, for example, to successful reductions in other areas of science. On the basis of these cases she can argue the implausibility of supposing that, uniquely, mental phenomena resist reduction to the causal properties of matter. That is, an inductive argument for reduction outweighs a conceivability argument against reduction. And in that case, the dualist must do more than merely insist that she has correctly imagined inverted spectra in isomorphic individuals. (For useful discussions of some of these issues, see Tye 1986 and Horgan 1987.)

7. Objections to Dualism Motivated by Scientific Considerations

The Ockham's Razor argument creates a strong methodological presumption against dualism, suggesting that the mind-body split multiplies entities unnecessarily in much the way that a demon theory of disease complicates the metaphysics of medicine compared to a germ theory. It is often alleged, more broadly, that dualism is unscientific and renders impossible any genuine science of mind or truly empirical psychology.

a. Arguments from Human Development

Those eager to defend the relevance of science to the study of mind, such as Paul Churchland, have argued that dualism is inconsistent with the facts of human evolution and fetal development. (1988, pp. 27-28; see also Lycan, 1996, p. 168). According to this view, we began as wholly physical beings. This is true of the species and the individual human. No one seriously supposes that newly fertilized ova are imbued with minds or that the original cell in the primordial sea was conscious. But from those entirely physical origins, nothing non-physical was later added. We can explain the evolution from the unicellular stage to present complexities by means of random mutations and natural selection in the species case and through the accretion of matter through nutritional intake in the individual case. But if we, as species or individuals, began as wholly physical beings and nothing nonphysical was later added, then we are still wholly physical creatures. Thus, dualism is false. The above arguments are only as strong as our reasons for thinking that we began as wholly material beings and that nothing non-physical was later added. Some people, particularly the religious, will object that macro-evolution of a species is problematic or that God might well have infused the developing fetus with a soul at some point in the developmental process (traditionally at quickening). Most contemporary philosophers of mind put little value in these rejoinders.

b. The Conservation of Energy Argument

Others argue that dualism is scientifically unacceptable because it violates the well-established principle of the conservation of energy. Interactionists argue that mind and matter causally interact. But if the spiritual realm is continually impinging on the universe and effecting changes, the total level of energy in the cosmos must be increasing or at least fluctuating. This is because it takes physical energy to do physical work. If the will alters states of affairs in the world (such as the state of my brain), then mental energy is somehow converted into physical energy. At the point of conversion, one would anticipate a physically inexplicable increase in the energy present within the system. If it also takes material energy to activate the mind, then "physical energy would have to vanish and reappear inside human brains." (Lycan, 1996, 168).

The dualists' basically have three ways of replying. First, they could deny the sacredness of the principle of the conservation of energy. This would be a desperate measure. The principle is too well established and its denial too ad hoc. Second, the dualist might offer that mind does contribute energy to our world, but that this addition is so slight, in relation to our means of detection, as to be negligible. This is really a re-statement of the first reply above, except that here the principle is valid in so far as it is capable of verification. Science can continue as usual, but it would be unreasonable to extend the law beyond our ability to confirm it experimentally. That would be to step from the empirical to the speculative—the very thing that the materialist objects to in dualism. The third option sidesteps the issue by appealing to another, perhaps equally valid, principle of physics. Keith Campbell (1970) writes:

The indeterminacy of quantum laws means that any one of a range of outcomes of atomic events in the brain is equally compatible with known physical laws. And differences on the quantum scale can accumulate into very great differences in overall brain condition. So there is some room for spiritual activity even within the limits set by physical law. There could be, without violation of physical law, a general spiritual constraint upon what occurs inside the head. (p. 54)

Mind could act upon physical processes by "affecting their course but not breaking in upon them" (1970, p. 54). If this is true, the dualist could maintain the conservation principle but deny a fluctuation in energy because the mind serves to "guide" or control neural events by choosing one set of quantum outcomes rather than another. Further, it should be remembered that the conservation of energy is designed around material interaction; it is mute on how mind might interact with matter. After all, a Cartesian rationalist might insist, if God exists we surely wouldn't say that He couldn't do miracles just because that would violate the first law of thermodynamics, would we?

c. Problems of Interaction

The conservation of energy argument points to a more general complaint often made against dualism: that interaction between mental and physical substances would involve a causal impossibility. Since the mind is, on the Cartesian model, immaterial and unextended, it can have no size, shape, location, mass, motion or solidity. How then can minds act on bodies? What sort of mechanism could convey information of the sort bodily movement requires, between ontologically autonomous realms? To suppose that non-physical minds can move bodies is like supposing that imaginary locomotives can pull real boxcars. Put differently, if mind-body interaction is possible, every voluntary action is akin to the paranormal power of telekinesis, or "mind over matter." If minds can, without spatial location, move bodies, why can my mind move immediately only one particular body and no others? Confronting the conundrum of interaction implicit in his theory, Descartes posited the existence of "animal spirits" somewhat subtler than bodies but thicker than minds. Unfortunately, this expedient proved a dead-end, since it is as incomprehensible how the mind could initiate motion in the animal spirits as in matter itself.

These problems involved in mind-body causality are commonly considered decisive refutations of interactionism. However, many interesting questions arise in this area. We want to ask: "How is mind-body interaction possible? Where does the interaction occur? What is the nature of the interface between mind and matter? How are volitions translated into states of affairs? Aren't minds and bodies insufficiently alike for the one to effect changes in the other?"

It is useful to be reminded, however, that to be bewildered by something is not in itself to present an argument against, or even evidence against, the possibility of that thing being a matter of fact. To ask "How is it possible that . . . ?" is merely to raise a topic for discussion. And if the dualist doesn't know or cannot say how minds and bodies interact, what follows about dualism? Nothing much. It only follows that dualists do not know everything about metaphysics. But so what? Psychologists, physicists, sociologists, and economists don't know everything about their respective disciplines. Why should the dualist be any different? In short, dualists can argue that they should not be put on the defensive by the request for clarification about the nature and possibility of interaction or by the criticism that they have no research strategy for producing this clarification.

The objection that minds and bodies cannot interact can be the expression of two different sorts of view. On the one hand, the detractor may insist that it is physically impossible that minds act on bodies. If this means that minds, being non-physical, cannot physically act on bodies, the claim is true but trivial. If it means that mind-body interaction violates the laws of physics (such as the first law of thermodynamics, discussed above), the dualist can reply that minds clearly do act on bodies and so the violation is only apparent and not real. (After all, if we do things for reasons, our beliefs and desires cause some of our actions). If the materialist insists that we are able to act on our beliefs, desires and perceptions only because they are material and not spiritual, the dualist can turn the tables on his naturalistic opponents and ask how matter, regardless of its organization, can produce conscious thoughts, feelings and perceptions. How, the dualist might ask, by adding complexity to the structure of the brain, do we manage to leap beyond the quantitative into the realm of experience? The relationship between consciousness and brain processes leaves the materialist with a causal mystery perhaps as puzzling as that confronting the dualist.

On the other hand, the materialist may argue that it is a conceptual truth that mind and matter cannot interact. This, however, requires that we embrace the rationalist thesis that causes can be known a priori. Many prefer to assert that causation is a matter for empirical investigation. We cannot, however, rule out mental causes based solely on the logic or grammar of the locutions "mind" and "matter." Furthermore, in order to defeat interactionism by an appeal to causal impossibility, one must first refute the Humean equation of causal connection with regularity of sequence and constant conjunction. Otherwise, anything can be the cause of anything else. If volitions are constantly conjoined with bodily movements and regularly precede them, they are Humean causes. In short, if Hume is correct, we cannot refute dualism a priori by asserting that transactions between minds and bodies involve links where, by definition, none can occur.

Some, such as Ducasse (1961, 88; cf. Dicker pp. 217-224), argue that the interaction problem rests on a failure to distinguish between remote and proximate causes. While it makes sense to ask how depressing the accelerator causes the automobile to speed up, it makes no sense to ask how pressing the accelerator pedal causes the pedal to move. We can sensibly ask how to spell a word in sign language, but not how to move a finger. Proximate causes are "basic" and analysis of them is impossible. There is no "how" to basic actions, which are brute facts. Perhaps the mind's influence on the pineal gland is basic and brute.

One final note: epiphenomenalism, like occasionalism and parallelism, is a dualistic theory of mind designed, in part, to avoid the difficulties involved in mental-physical causation (although occasionalism was also offered by Malebranche as an account of seemingly purely physical causation). According to epiphenomenalism, bodies are able to act on minds, but not the reverse. The causes of behavior are wholly physical. As such, we need not worry about how objects without mass or physical force can alter behavior. Nor need we be concerned with violations of the conservation of energy principle since there is little reason to suppose that physical energy is required to do non-physical work. If bodies affect modifications in the mental medium, that need not be thought to involve a siphoning of energy from the world to the psychic realm. On this view, the mind may be likened to the steam from a train engine; the steam does not affect the workings of the engine but is caused by it. Unfortunately, epiphenomenalism avoids the problem of interaction only at the expense of denying the common-sense view that our states of mind have some bearing on our conduct. For many, epiphenomenalism is therefore not a viable theory of mind. (For a defense of the common-sense claim that beliefs and attitudes and reasons cause behavior, see Donald Davidson.)

d. The Correlation and Dependence Arguments

The correlation and dependence argument against dualism begins by noting that there are clear correlations between certain mental events and neural events (say, between pain and a-fiber or c-fiber stimulation). Moreover, as demonstrated in such phenomena as memory loss due to head trauma or wasting disease, the mind and its capacities seem dependent upon neural function. The simplest and best explanation of this dependence and correlation is that mental states and events are neural states and events and that pain just is c-fiber stimulation. (This would be the argument employed by an identity theorist. A functionalist would argue that the best explanation for the dependence and correlation of mental and physical states is that, in humans, mental states are brain states functionally defined).

Descartes himself anticipated an objection like this and argued that dependence does not strongly support identity. He illustrates by means of the following example: a virtuoso violinist cannot manifest his or her ability if given an instrument in deplorable or broken condition. The manifestation of the musician's ability is thus dependent upon being able to use a well-tuned instrument in proper working order. But from the fact that the exhibition of the maestro's skill is impossible without a functioning instrument, it hardly follows that being skilled at playing the violin amounts to no more than possessing such an instrument. Similarly, the interactionist can claim that the mind uses the brain to manifest it's abilities in the public realm. If, like the violin, the brain is in a severely diseased or injurious state, the mind cannot demonstrate its abilities; they of necessity remain private and unrevealed. However, for all we know, the mind still has its full range of abilities, but is hindered in its capacity to express them. As for correlation, interactionism actually predicts that mental events are caused by brain events and vice versa, so the fact that perceptions are correlated with activity in the visual cortex does not support materialism over this form of dualism. Property dualists agree with the materialists that mental phenomena are dependent upon physical phenomena, since the fomer are (non-physical) attributes of the latter. Materialists are aware of these dualist replies and sometimes invoke Ockham's razor and the importance of metaphysical simplicity in arguments to the best explanation. (See Churchland, 1988, p. 28). Other materialist responses will not be considered here.

8. The Problem of Other Minds

The problem of how we can know other minds has been used as follows to refute dualism. If the mind is not publicly observable, the existence of minds other than our own must be inferred from the behavior of the other person or organism. The reliability of this inference is deeply suspect, however, since we only know that certain mental states cause characteristic behavior from our own case. To extrapolate to the population as a whole from the direct inspection of a single example, our own case, is to make the weakest possible inductive generalization. Hence, if dualism is true, we cannot know that other people have minds at all. But common sense tell us that others do have minds. Since common sense can be trust, dualism is false.

This problem of other minds, to which dualism leads so naturally, is often used to support rival theories such as behaviorism, the mind-brain identity theory, or functionalism (though functionalists sometimes claim that their theory is consistent with dualism). Since the mind, construed along Cartesian lines, leads to solipsism (that is, to the epistemological belief that one's self is the only existence that can be verified and known), it is better to operationalize the mind and define mental states behaviorally, functionally, or physiologically. If mental states are just behavioral states, brain states, or functional states, then we can verify that others have mental states on the basis of publicly observable phenomena, thereby avoiding skepticism about other selves.

Materialist theories are far less vulnerable to the problem of other minds than dualist theories, though even here other versions of the problem stubbornly reappear. Deciding to define mental states behaviorally does not mean that mental states are behavioral, and it is controversial whether attempts to reduce mentality to behavioral, brain, or functional states have been successful. Moreover, the "Absent Qualia" argument claims that it is perfectly imaginable and consistent with everything that we know about physiology that, of two functionally or physiologically isomorphic beings, one might be conscious and the other not. Of two outwardly indistinguishable dopplegangers, one might have experience and the other none. Both would exhibit identical neural activity; both would insist that they can see the flowers in the meadow and deny that they are "blind"; both would be able to obey the request to go fetch a red flower; and yet only one would have experience. The other would be like an automaton. Consequently, it is sometimes argued, even a materialist cannot be wholly sure that other existing minds have experience of a qualitative (whence, "qualia") sort. The problem for the materialist then becomes not the problem of other minds, but the problem of other qualia. The latter seems almost as severe an affront to common sense as the former. (For an interesting related discussion, see Churchland on eliminative materialism, 1988, pp. 43-49.)

9. Criticisms of the Mind as a Thinking Thing

We earlier observed that some philosophers, such as Hume, have objected that supposing that the mind is a thinking thing is not warranted since all we apprehend of the self by introspection is a collection of ideas but never the mind that purportedly has these ideas. All we are therefore left with is a stream of impressions and ideas but no persisting, substantial self to constitute personal identity. If there is no substratum of thought, then substance dualism is false. Kant, too, denied that the mind is a substance. Mind is simply the unifying factor that is the logical preliminary to experience.

The idea that the mind is not a thinking thing was revived in the twentieth century by philosophical behaviorists. According to Gilbert Ryle in his seminal 1949 work The Concept of Mind, "when we describe people as exercising qualities of mind, we are not referring to occult episodes of which their overt acts and utterances are effects; we are referring to those overt acts and utterances themselves." (p. 25). Thus, "When a person is described by one or other of the intelligence epithets such as 'shrewd' or 'silly', 'prudent' or 'imprudent', the description imputes to him not the knowledge, or ignorance, of this or that truth, but the ability, or inability, to do certain sorts of things." (p. 27). For the behaviorist, we say that the clown is clever because he can fall down deliberately yet make it look like an accident We say the student is bright because she can tell us the correct answer to complex, involved equations. Mental events reduce to bodily events or statements about the body. As Ludwig Wittgenstein notes in his Blue Book:

It is misleading then to talk of thinking as of a "mental activity." We may say that thinking is essentially the activity of operating with signs. This activity is performed by the hand, when we think by writing; by the mouth and larynx, when we think by speaking; and if we think by imagining signs or pictures, I can give you no agent that thinks. If then you say that in such cases the mind thinks, I would only draw your attention to the fact that you are using a metaphor. (1958, p. 6)

John Wisdom (1934) explains: "'I believe monkeys detest jaguars' means 'This body is in a state which is liable to result in the group of reactions which is associated with confident utterance of 'Monkeys detest jaguars,' namely keeping 'favorite' monkeys from jaguars and in general acting as if monkeys detested jaguars.'" (p. 56-7).

Philosophical behaviorism as developed by followers of Wittgenstein was supported in part by the Private Language Argument. Anthony Kenny (1963) explains:

Any word purporting to be the name of something observable only by introspection (i.e. a mental event)... would have to acquire its meaning by a purely private and uncheckable performance . . . If the names of the emotions acquire their meaning for each of us by a ceremony from which everyone else is excluded, then none of us can have any idea what anyone else means by the word. Nor can anyone know what he means by the word himself; for to know the meaning of a word is to know how to use it rightly; and where there can be no check on how a man uses a word there is no room to talk of "right" and "wrong" use (p. 13).

Mentalistic terms do not have meaning by virtue of referring to occult phenomena, but by virtue of referring to something public in a certain way. To understand the meaning of words like "mind," "idea," "thought," "love," "fear," "belief," "dream," and so forth, we must attend to how these words are actually learned in the first place. When we do this, the behaviorist is confident that the mind will be demystified.

Although philosophical behaviorism has fallen out of fashion, its recommendations to attend to the importance of the body and language in attempting to understand the mind have remained enduring contributions. Although dualism faces serious challenges, we have seen that many of these difficulties can be identified in its philosophical rivals in slightly different forms.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle, Categories.
  • Armstrong, D. M.: A Materialist Theory of the Mind (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1968) Chapter Two.
  • Baker, Gordon and Morris, Katherine J. Descartes' Dualism (Routledge, London 1996).
  • Block, Ned, Owen Flanagan, and Gueven Guezeldere eds. The Nature of Consciousness: Philosophical Debates (MIT Press, Cambridge 1997).
  • Brentano, Franz: Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint trans. A. Rancurello, D. Terrell, and L. McAlister (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1874/1973).
  • Broad, C. D. Mind and Its Place in Nature (Routledge and Kegan Paul, London 1962).
  • Campbell, Keith: Body and Mind (Anchor Books, Doubleday & Co., Garden City NJ 1970).
  • Chalmers, David J.: The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1996).
  • Churchland, Paul: Matter and Consciousness, Revised Edition (MIT Press, Cambridge MA 1988).
  • Davidson, Donald: "Actions, Reasons and Causes" The Journal of Philosophy 60 (1963) pp. 685- 700, reprinted in The Philosophy of Action, Alan White, ed. (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1973).
  • Descartes, Rene: Discourse on Method and Meditations on First Philosophy, Donald A. Cress trans. (Hackett Publishing Co., Indianapolis 1980).
  • Descartes, Rene: Descartes' Philosophical Writings, selected and translated by Norman Kemp Smith (Macmillan, London 1952).
  • Descartes, Rene: The Philosophical Works of Descartes, vol.2, Elizabeth S. Haldane, trans. (Cambridge University Press, 1912).
  • Dicker, Georges: Descartes: An Analytical and Historical Introduction (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1993).
  • Ducasse, C. J.: "In Defense of Dualism" in Dimensions of Mind, Sydney Hook, ed. (Macmillan, NY 1961).
  • Garber, Daniel: Descartes Embodied: Reading Cartesian Philosophy through Cartesian Science (Cambridge University Press, Cambridge 2001).
  • Harman, Gilbert: Thought (Princeton University Press, Princeton 1973).
  • Hart, William D. "Dualism" in A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind, Samuel Guttenplan, ed. (Basil Blackwell, Oxford 1994) pp. 265-269.
  • Horgan, Terence: "Supervenient Qualia" Philosophical Review 96 (1987) pp. 491-520.
  • Hume, David: An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (Hackett Publishing, Indianapolis 1977).
  • Joad, C. E. M.: How Our Minds Work (Philosophical Library, 1947).
  • Kant, Immanuel: Critique of Pure Reason, Norman Kemp Smith, trans. (Macmillan, London 1963).
  • Kenny, Anthony: Action, Emotion and the Will (Routledge & Kegan Paul, London 1963).
  • Kim, Jaegwon: Philosophy of Mind (Westview Press, Boulder 1996).
  • Kripke, Saul: Naming and Necessity (Harvard University Press, Cambridge 1980).
  • Locke, John: Essay Concerning Human Understanding vol. 1, collated and annotated by Alexander Fraser (Dover Publications, NY 1959).
  • Lycan, William: "Philosophy of Mind" in The Blackwell companion to Philosophy, Nicholas Bunnin and E. P. Tsui-James eds. (Blackwell Publishers, Oxford 1996).
  • Madell, G. The Identity of the Self (Edinburgh University Press, 1983).
  • Malcolm, Norman: "Knowledge of Other Minds" in The Philosophy of Mind, V. C. Chappell, ed. (Prentice-Hall , Englewood Cliffs 1962).
  • McLaughlin, Brian P.: "Epiphenomenalism" in A Companion to the Philosophy of Mind, Samuel Guttenplan, ed. (Blackwell, Oxford 1994).
  • Mill, J. S. : An Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, 6th ed. (Longman's, London 1889).
  • Nagel, Thomas: "Brain Bisection and the Unity of Consciousness" in Jonathan Glover, ed. The Philosophy of Mind (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1976).
  • Nagel, Thomas: The View From Nowhere (Oxford University Press, Oxford 1986).
  • Nagel, Thomas: "What Is It Like to Be a Bat?" Philosophical Review 83 (1974) 435-450.
  • Plato: Meno.
  • Plato: Phaedo.
  • Rey, Georges: Contemporary Philosophy of Mind (Blackwell Publishers, Cambridge 1997).
  • Rorty, Richard: Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (Princeton University Press, Princeton NJ 1979).
  • Rorty, Richard: "Mind-Body Identity, Privacy and Categories" in The Mind/Brain Identity Theory, C. V. Borst ed. (Macmillan, London 1970).
  • Ryle, Gilbert: The Concept of Mind, (University Paperbacks, Barnes & Noble, NY 1949).
  • Shoemaker, Sydney: Self-Knowledge and Self-Identity (Cornell University Press, Ithaca 1963).
  • Taylor, Richard: Metaphysics, 3rd edition (Prentice Hall, Englewood Cliffs 1983).
  • Tye, Michael: "The Subjective Qualities of Experience" Mind 95 (Jan. 1986) pp. 1-17.
  • Williams, Bernard: "Freedom and the Will" in Freedom and the Will, D. F. Pears, ed. (Macmillan, London 1966).
  • Wisdom, John: Problems of Mind and Matter, (Cambridge University Press, 1934).
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig: The Blue and Brown Books (Harper & Row, NY 1958).

Author Information

Scott Calef
Ohio Wesleyan University
U. S. A.

Donald Davidson: Anomalous Monism

davidson2Anomalous Monism is a type of property dualism in the philosophy of mind. Property dualism combines the thesis that mental phenomena are strictly irreducible to physical phenomena with the denial that mind and body are discrete substances. For the anomalous monist, the plausibility of property dualism derives from the fact that although mental states, events and processes have genuine causal powers, the causal relationships that they enter into with physical entities cannot be explained by appeal to fundamental laws of nature. This doctrine about the relationship between mind and body was first explicitly defended by Donald Davidson in his paper “Mental Events,” though its root in the Western philosophical tradition go back at least as far as Spinoza. It was a topic of energetic debate and disagreement among English-speaking philosophers for the last thirty years of the twentieth century.

The extent to which Davidson’s commitment to anomalous monism turns out to derive from his views about methodology is partly obscured by his own tendency (shared by the majority of both his followers and his critics) to discuss issues connected with the mind/body problem in traditionally metaphysical terms. But whenever he actually sets about the task of defending the statement that mental events cause physical events, what is at issue always turns out to be a distinctively methodological question: When we set about explaining the actions of other human beings, to what extent must we employ our own, perhaps entirely parochial, standards for determining what counts as rational behavior?

Table of Contents

  1. A Trilemma
  2. Historical Precursors
    1. Parallelism
    2. Verstehen Theory
  3. Mental Events are Physical Events
  4. The Irreducibility of the Mental
    1. Supervenience and Anomalous Monism
    2. “Strict” and “Non-Strict” Natural Laws
  5. A Methodological Postscript
  6. References and Further Reading

1. A Trilemma

Anomalous Monism (AM) is a philosophical thesis about the place of the mind and of mental states in the natural order. The term was first used by Donald Davidson in his 1970 paper “Mental Events.” Since the publication of this paper, Davidson has re-described and refined his position on the mind/body problem in a number of different ways, and both critics and supporters of AM have come up with their own characterizations of the thesis, many of which appear to differ from Davidson’s in non-trivial ways. Nonetheless, AM is distinguished from other positions in the philosophy of mind by the three following claims:

  1. Mental events cause physical events.
  2. All causal relationships are backed by natural laws.
  3. There are no natural laws connecting mental phenomena with physical phenomena.

Taken separately, none of these claims has won anything like universal support from philosophers in the contemporary tradition. So-called “epiphenomenalists” about the nature of mental events and processes would certainly deny the truth of (1). (2) appears to require both denying that the notion of a causal disposition is more primitive than that of a natural law, as well as affirming an implausibly strict distinction between genuine laws of nature and mere statistical generalizations. And proponents of a reductionist view of the mind, at least as this sort of position has traditionally been articulated, would certainly have to deny the truth of (3).

Even if none of these arguments are successful, this trio of claims gives off a pretty strong whiff of inconsistency. Nonetheless, Davidson maintains that all three are true. The best route to understanding this is to start out by taking a somewhat broader look at the relevant historical backdrop. It is also necessary to acquaint oneself with Davidson’s broader philosophical program.

2. Historical Precursors

a. Parallelism

The early modern philosopher whose views on the relationship between mind and body bear the closest similarity to AM is Benedict De Spinoza. Like most philosophers of his period, Spinoza was preoccupied with the central problem of the Cartesian inheritance, namely, that of accounting for the apparently systematic causal interaction between mind and body. This problem had arisen for Descartes specifically because he had believed that mind and body were discrete types of substances with irreconcilable natures. ContraDescartes, Spinoza denied that mind and body were separate substances at all, and proposed instead that they are merely separate attributes of a single substance. He suggested that, for every physical item P, there is a corresponding mental item I(P), which he identified as “the idea of P.” The human mind, for example, was nothing for Spinoza but the “idea” of the human body. These “ideas” differ from one another in “perfection,” based upon the complexity of the physical object to which each corresponds.

In Book Two of the Ethics, Spinoza goes on to defend (very briefly) the doctrine of psycho-physical parallelism. He proposes that “the order and connection of ideas is the same as the order and connection of things.” [de Spinoza, 1949, p. 83] This remark is usually taken to imply that for every causal chain of ideas, there is a sequence of physical causes and effects that run parallel to it through time, like so [see Bennett pp. 127-132]:

t1 t2 t3 t4 t5
Sequence A P1 P2 P3 P4 P5
Sequence B I(P)1 I(P)2 I(P)3 I(P)4 I(P)5

Spinoza showed no obvious sign of interest in whether one of these two causal orders is more fundamental. But since he was a strict determinist, it seems he believed that the relations that obtain among the items belonging to both causal sequences were law-like in nature. He may thus plausibly be read as having accepted the truth of something like statement (1).

A further distinctive feature of Spinoza’s metaphysical monism, however, was his denial that there could be any ‘causal flow’ between different attributes of the single substance that he identified both with God and with Nature. This might make it appear that he have endorsed statement (3) of our original trilemma at the price of rejecting statement (1).

But when we read the Ethics from the other side of the ‘linguistic turn’ in twentieth century Western philosophy, there is a strong temptation to reinterpret Spinoza’s metaphysical distinction between a single substance and its many attributes. Post linguistic turn, this amounts to the distinction between a single class of entities and the plurality of equally well-grounded ways that may exist of describing them. It is thus perhaps not too coercive to interpret Spinoza’s parallelism as implying that there is a systematic problem with the practice of referring to mental and physical phenomena as entering into causal relations with one another. But this is perfectly consistent with the truth of statement (1). In this qualified sense, then, Spinozistic parallelism may be viewed as a genuine historical precursor to AM.

Two questions immediately arise about the doctrine of parallelism as just described. First, if there really is an absolutely reliable pairing-off between the constituents of physical and mental causal chains, then why couldn’t we just use characterizations of items in Sequence B as though they referred to items in Sequence A? Why couldn’t claims about the “ideas” of objects be used in the natural sciences, but there understood as merely abbreviating claims about those physical objects themselves? The feature of Spinoza’s philosophy that makes it impossible for him to allow for this is his commitment to causal rationalism – the thesis that for any genuinely causal relationship one should always be able to deduce the effect from a true description of the cause [see de Spinoza, 1949, p. 42ff]. This is not a doctrine that would appeal to the sensibilities of many contemporary philosophers, but it does turn out to have an important analog in Davidson’s treatment of the mind/body problem.

The second question that arises about Spinoza’s parallelism concerns the fact that even the very simplest and most transparent of mental phenomena appear to depend for their existence upon a highly complex collection of physical phenomena. But then why suppose that just any physical event, no matter how simple (the movement of a single electron, say) must have an ideational correlate? If one chooses to hypothesize that a specific degree of physical complexity is necessary for a mental phenomenon to occur, then the threat (or promise) of reductionism looms. But most contemporary philosophers would certainly favor reductionism over the alternative of panpsychism that Spinoza himself embraces [de Spinoza, 1949, p. 90]. Interestingly Davidson himself also ends up embracing an analog of panpsychism in the course of his struggle to harmonize statements (1) –(3).

b. Verstehen Theory

Davidson’s own views about the nature of mind emerged out of a set of disputes that were instructively similar to the arguments that took place among philosophers during the Cartesian era. For most of the twentieth century, philosophers both on the European continent and in English-speaking universities had been preoccupied with the autonomy of humanistic enquiry. This issue was (and continues to be) a source of disagreements that extend well beyond the relatively narrow boundaries of metaphysical debate and into the realms of institutional policymaking and literary and artistic culture. Among analytic philosophers of the 1960s, disputes upon this general topic were focused largely around a question that was partly epistemological and partly ontological in its significance, whether or not it is appropriate to view thereasons that people have for performing specific actions as also themselves being causes of those actions.

According to one school of thought, which more or less began with the Verstehen theorists of the nineteenth century – Wilhelm Dilthey, Max Weber and Bendetto Croce, among others – the aim of the social sciences and of humanistic enquiry in general is not the discovery of causal relationships at all. To others, however – mechanists, materialists and methodological monists about the sciences – such claims were deemed to be either patently false or well-nigh incomprehensible [See Anthony, 1989, p. 155, for a full discussion]. Seen against this backdrop, Davidson’s own approach to the issue of how reasons relate to causes takes on the appearance of a compromise position. For Davidson both rejects reductionism and denies the view that the distinction between reasons and causes is as absolute as the Verstehentheorists wanted to claim.

In a famous example, Davidson describes a situation in which a mountain climber accidentally causes the death of another man by loosening his grip on a tethering rope. Suppose that this happened, not because the first climber was deliberately setting out to do in his comrade, but rather because he was merely “unnerved” by the thought that he could make himself safer by ridding himself of the extra weight. What we need, Davidson suggests, is to be able to distinguish this sort of circumstance from a situation in which the climber really does drop his comrade intentionally to rid himself of the extra weight. In this second case, the reason (that the first climber had for being concerned for his own safety) was also a cause (of the death of the second climber). But then there is a differentiation between reasons that are not causes and reasons which are. [Davidson, 1973, p. 79]

In “Thinking Causes,” Davidson explains the metaphysical significance of these observations. He says here that “anomalous monism holds that mental entities (particular time- and space-bound objects and events) are physical entities, but that mental concepts are not reducible by definition or natural law to physical concepts.” [Davidson, 1993, p. 3]. Thus, while the sorts of mental events that we habitually identify as reasons (under which broad classification he includes “perceivings, notings, calculations, judgements, decisions, internal actions and changes of belief” [Davidson, 1970, p. 208]) may also beidentified as causes, this does not preclude us from being able to appeal to the difference between reasons and causes as part of a general characterization of what is distinctive about the human sciences.

The description of AM given thus far does nothing to distinguish it from other, substantively different forms of so-called “property dualism” in the contemporary philosophy of mind. We must first ask why Davidson believes that mental events are identical with physical events, and then ask why he nonetheless denies the reducibility of the one to the other.

3. Mental Events are Physical Events

A crucial part of Davidson’s overall strategy for reconciling statements (1)-(3) is his endorsement of the thesis of token physicalism (TKP). This is the doctrine that while mental properties (types) cannot be identified with physical properties, mental particulars (tokens) can be identified with particular, spatio-temporally determinate physical entities. Davidson is not the only influential analytic philosopher to have defended this doctrine, but his reasons for doing so arise from a fairly idiosyncratic set of views.

The most distinctive feature of Davidson’s version of TKP is that it is a doctrine about events, rather than processes, states, or (at least in the primary instance) objects [see Davidson, 1970, p. 210]. His belief in the ontological primacy of events arises from the underlying logical form of certain types of English sentences; the fact that we can comprehend that sentences like “Jones buttered the toast deliberately in the bathroom with a knife at midnight” entails the sentence “Jones buttered the toast” cannot be explained (Davidson thinks) without supposing that both make implicit reference to some spatio-temporally bounded particular event [for the full argument, see Davidson, 1967, pp. 105-107]. The identity conditions of events can furthermore, he thinks, be established purely extensionally: event A and event B are identical if and only if they have all of the same causes and all of the same effects. [Davidson, 1969, p. 179]

When we successfully pick out an event by means of a mentalistic description as being the cause of some other, physical event, we have according to Davidson done all that is necessary to show that there is mental causation. He traces this minimalist approach to the classification of events as mental back to the writings of Elizabeth Anscombe, who famously defended the view that all that is necessary for an act’s having been intended is that it be truly describable as such [Davidson, 1967, p. 147]. So what, then counts as a genuinely mentalistic description of any given event? Davidson’s own views upon this subject are less than entirely clear. In “Mental Events” he makes the more general proposal that the hallmark of the mental is intensionality. That is, true descriptions of mental events include a verb with a subject that refers to a person, and a complement for which the usual rules of substitution break down. Thus, while “Lois thought that Clark Kent was lovely” would clearly count as a mentalistic description of an event, since she might not have thought the same about Superman, “Lois was smaller than Clark Kent” would fail to satisfy the aforementioned criterion.

It is important to recognize, however, that intensionality is for Davidson merely a sufficient condition for mentality; he does not seem to regard it as being even close to necessary. This is clear from some rather startling remarks that he makes in “Mental Events.” He asks us to consider “some event that we all intuitively accept as physical, let’s say the collision of two stars in distant space.” If we can truthfully describe this event as being merely simultaneous to some other clearly mental event, then this fact is enough by itself, Davidson thinks, for us to be warranted in describing the former occurrence as a mental event too [Davidson, 1970, p. 211].

Davidson suggests that this sort of “Spinozistic extravagance” is philosophically harmless to the case for AM because it provides us with all the better reason for believing TKP. For the more inclusive our criteria for mentality are, the more reason we will have to accept that all mental events are identical to physical events [Davidson, 1970, p. 212]. But one thing that these considerations seem to imply is that every event A that is caused by some mental event B will also have the very same event as a physical cause. And this makes it look as though the defender of AM will either have to explain away an unpalatable form of causal over-determination in the natural sciences, or else regard mental events as being purely epiphenomenal.

The claim that AM is really just epiphenomenalism in disguise has been the single most common and widespread criticism of Davidson’s thesis since the publication of “Mental Events.” The suggestion was first made by Ted Honderich in a paper from 1982. Honderich draws a suggestive analogy between mental properties and the properties possessed by a bunch of green pears sitting on a grocer’s scale. These pieces of fruit maybe truly described as green, or as French, but the fact that they possess these properties is clearly not what causes them to make the scale read “1 lb.” So why should the fact that we can describe some events in ways that satisfy Davidson’s rather permissive criteria for mentality lead us to believe that the natural world contains even a single instance of mental causation? [Honderich , 1982, pp. 61-62]. The same objection is made somewhat more abstractly by Jaegwon Kim when he described what he calls the “exclusion problem” for mental causation. Suppose that an event m causes a distinct event e, and that m has two properties, M and P. Furthermore suppose that only the property P of m is connected by a strict causal law to some property of e. But then, Kim asks how the property M can be understood to be doing any “causal work” whatsoever [Kim, 1993, pp. 25-26].

Davidson responds to challenges of this general type by re-iterating his commitment to a strictly extensionalist account of event-causation. It is simply infelicitous, he thinks, to suppose that whether or not one event is the cause of another depends upon our ability to connect up their properties in any sort of statement whatsoever, whether law-like or not. As he puts it in “Thinking Causes,”

There is…no room for a concept of ‘cause as’ that would make causality a relation among three or four entities rather than two. On the view of events and causality assumed here, it makes no more sense to say event c caused event e as instantiating law L than it makes to say that a weighs less than b as belonging to sort c [Davidson, 1993, p. 6].

Many philosophers have found this characterization of causality by Davidson singularly implausible. For it does not seem as though extensionalism by itself simply implies that events do not have the causal powers that they do by virtue of falling under causal laws [see McLaughlin, 1993, pp. 30-34]. And regardless of whether one is talking about events, physical objects, thoughts, or whatever, it is surely a perfectly natural and coherent question to ask whether it is because something has a property M that it causes something else to have property N. At least one recent defender of AM has suggested that perhaps the very notion of causation itself is a fundamentally ambiguous one, in the sense that its content changes depending upon whether we employ the discrete standards of rational intelligibility that are required by either a “personal” or an “impersonal” perspective upon the natural world [see Hornsby, 1997, p. 140]. To adopt this thesis about causation would appear to represent an abandonment of the project of finding a genuinely intermediate position between the approach favored by Verstehen theorists to explanation in the human sciences and the traditional forms of metaphysical materialism to which Davidson himself appears to be willing to give at least qualified endorsement.

One of Davidson’s earlier claims about the relationship between mind and body is that the mentalsupervenes upon the physical. To say that properties of type X supervene upon properties of type Y is at the very least to commit oneself to the view that objects and events cannot differ X-wise without also differing Y-wise. If this were in fact the case, one could argue that there is at least some minimal sense in which the possession of mental properties “makes a difference” to the causal relations exhibited by particular physical events. For, unlike the properties of color and nationality possessed by the pears in Honderich’s famous example, supervenient mental properties are always going to stand in an empirically significant relationship to the physical regularities that that are exhibited among the physical properties that they supervene upon.

But the supervenience relation is one that has been characterized in multitudinous different ways in late twentieth-century philosophy [See Kim, 1990 for a fairly exhaustive catalogue]. Not all of the accounts that have been given would provide equally good support for this contention. According to Kim, the most pressing question about the supervenience relation is whether it might actually entail the reducibility of the supervenient class of properties or concepts to their subvenient base. What, then, are some reasons that the defender of AM might give for denying that mental concepts are simply reducible to physical ones?

4. The Irreducibility of the Mental

a. Supervenience and Anomalous Monism

Davidson describes the relationship of supervenience as the key to understanding how mental phenomena may be “in some sense dependent” upon physical phenomena in spite of there not being any strict psycho-physical laws [Davidson, 1970, p. 214]. He clearly regards the notion of supervenience as representing a sort of panacea for anyone skeptical about the possibility of reconciling statements (1)-(3) [Davidson, 1993, p. 4]. So what, precisely, is the supervenience relation supposed to amount to?

The earliest instance of an appeal to the notion of supervenience in the twentieth century was by S.E. Pepper, in a paper first published in 1926. Pepper used the word “supervenient” to refer to a type ofchange that gives rise to emergent properties in the objects undergoing the relevant transformation [see van Brakel, 1999, pp. 4-5]. Over the last thirty years of the twentieth century, the term “supervenience” came to be used by philosophers in a wide variety of contexts, not only in ethics and the philosophy of mind, but in areas as diverse as aesthetics, modal metaphysics, the philosophy of biology and philosophical theology. Davidson himself acknowledges having borrowed the term from R.M. Hare’s discussion of the relationship between ethical and natural properties in The Language of Morals. Unlike Pepper, both Hare and Davidson characterize supervenience in explicitly linguistic terms, without reference to metaphysical notions like emergence that is supposed to be antecedently clear. Thus, for Davidson, “a predicate P is supervenient on a set of predicates S if and only if P does not distinguish any entities that cannot be distinguished by S” [Davidson, 1993, p. 4].

What is most striking about this characterization of the supervenience relation is its apparent weakness. When we make a Davidsonian supervenience claim we do not undertake any commitment whatsoever to the thesis that the supervening predicate can be could be shown to be redundant by even the most vigorous applications of Ockham’s razor.

In “Mental Events” Davidson develops two puzzling but suggestive analogies for the way in which the mental may be thought of as supervening upon the physical. He first suggests that we think of mentalistic predicates as being like the Tarskian truth predicate and the vocabulary of physics as being like the resources that are present within a natural language to describe its own syntax. For the truth predicate as Tarski describes it had the following important characteristic: it cannot be defined using only the resources of the object language, even though one might well be able to pick out all of the sentences that lie within its extension [see Davidson, 1970, pp. 214-215]. The other comparison that he makes involves an allusion to the failure of what he refers to as “definitional behaviorism” in scientific psychology. This theory was abandoned by empirical psychologists, he suggests, not because of any single piece of disconfirming evidence, but rather because they noticed “system in the failures” of behaviorists to define concepts like belief and desire in explicitly behavioral terms [see Davidson, 1970, p. 217].

In contrast to these suggestive but rather underdeveloped analogies, Jaegwon Kim famously argues that the supervenience of a class of properties G upon another class D actually entails that G is reducible to D[see Kim, 1984, p. 78]. If this claim were correct, then it would certainly be difficult to see how a Davidsonian could claim that there were no strict laws of nature connecting mental properties with physical ones. It is less clear that from Davidson’s own characterizations of supervenience in terms of the mere distinguishability of objects represents a weaker notion than that which is favored by reductionists following Kim.

A somewhat more subtle and less radical criticism of Davidson’s use of the supervenience relation to defend AM has been offered by Simon Blackburn. Blackburn parses supervenience claims as non-trivial restrictions upon how we conceive of the possibility that different sorts of objects could exist within the same world. Even the weakest sorts of supervenience claims, he suggests, involves implicit reference to the notion that an object has some property as the result of also possessing what he refers to an “underlying” set of natural (i.e. physical) properties. To say that property M supervenes upon property P, then, is to make an assertion with the following logical form:

(S) Necessarily, if there exists some x such that Mx and Px and if Px underlies Mx, then, for all y, if Py then My [Blackburn, 1985, p. 131].

Blackburn points out that the truth of any instance of (S) would be perfectly consistent with there beingsome possible worlds containing objects which have P (which may turn out to be some extremely complex or disjunctive physical property) while lacking M. Nonetheless, he thinks that our default modal intuitions should cause us to rankle whenever we are presented with a claim having the form of (S). We should react this way, he thinks, because (S) represents a violation of what he calls the “principle of plentitude” about possible worlds. Why shouldn’t there be possible worlds in which some objects or events that instantiate a given set of physical predicates also instantiate a given mental property, while others do not? This, according to Blackburn, is the key metaphysical question that the doctrine of AM compels us to ask, but for which its advocates have never really provided an answer [Blackburn, 1985, p. 135].

According to Blackburn’s recipe for supervenience, “underlying” properties will always be physical ones. It thus seems pretty clear that violations of the “principle of plentitude” about possible worlds of the sort that Blackburn is talking about here must occur at the level of nomological (as opposed to logical, metaphysical or epistemic) possibility. The advocate of AM would surely, after all, not want to deny that it is at least logically possible for a world to contain two physically identical beings, one with a mind and one without, not that such a circumstance fell entirely outside the range of human conceivability. Thus, if the question that Blackburn asks about supervenience is the right one to pose to the anomalous monist, then we may at this stage draw an important methodological conclusion. It looks as though Davidson’s claim that the mental supervenes upon the physical is, after all, really just another way of stating his commitment to the impossibility of strict natural laws connecting mental and physical phenomena. In order to understand why the advocate of AM will be committed to the irreducibility of the mental, then, one need only ask what he thinks it is about instances of mental causation that makes them insusceptible to the sort of explanation that can be provided by appeal to so-called “strict” natural laws.

b. “Strict” and “Non-Strict” Natural Laws

A universal generalization is law-like, according to Davidson, just so long as it provides support for a suitably broad set of subjunctive and counterfactual conditionals. For example, the statement “Whenever it rains, the grass gets wet” might well count as law-like, since it provides at least partial supports for the claims “If it were to rain next week, the grass would be wet” and “If it had not rained this morning, the grass would not presently be wet” – provided, at least, that we restrict our attention to possible words where a sprinkler is not available. A law-like statement also qualifies as “homonomic” if the scope of its generality can be increased by means of “adding further provisos and conditions,” all of which can be stated in “the same general vocabulary as the original statement.” “Whenever it rains, the grass gets wet” would thus presumably fail to count as homonomic, since the ceteris paribus clause “…unless someone has pitched a tent in the yard” is not a statement that makes exclusive use of the language of meteorology.

A strict law of nature for Davidson will thus be a homonomic law-like generalization that has been supplemented to the fullest possible extent by ceteris paribus clauses that do not violate this restriction. All general causal statements connecting mentalistic and physicalistic concepts must, according to Davidson, be regarded as non-strict, or “heteronomic” in nature.

Davidson proposes, controversially, that the criterion just described for what it takes to be a natural law is an a priori truth [see Davidson, 1970, pp. 216-220]. But from whence comes his confidence that it is possible, even in principle, to come up with these sorts of generalization anywhere in the natural sciences? He repeatedly claims that such completely exceptionless generalizations are most likely to be found in theoretical physics. But this assertion is not defended. Furthermore, even if he is right that such perfectly “strict” laws of nature could in principle be set down, the question remains whether there are good reasons to suspect that any of the vocabulary currently available for use in the natural sciences is suitable for the formulation of these sorts of statements. In response to these sorts of concerns, a fairly broad contingent of philosophers of science have defended accounts of the concept of a natural law which represent scientific knowledge as being heteronomic through and through [See e.g. Cartwright, 1994 and Fodor 1974].

Another more subtle issue has been raised by some philosophers in connection with Davidson’s rather thin conception of natural law. It seems possible to identify a fairly broad class of generalizations whose status as laws of nature does not depend upon either their predictive usefulness or the vocabulary within which ceteris paribus clauses for them are formulated. These are what Robert Cummins calls “instantiation laws.” The logical form of instantiation laws, as Cummins describes them, is as follows: Anything having components C1…Cn organized in manner O has property P [See Cummins, 1981, p. 17]. Such generalizations serve to explain what it is about the structure of some system that makes the system an instantiation of a given property. They do not explain how it is that that system’s properties change over time. Entries in the Periodic Table of the elements would appear to qualify as expressions of this sort of law, since the information that they communicate is that the arrangement of a specific number of electrons around an atomic nucleus at a given set of energy levels is what makes one atom count as a sample of hydrogen, oxygen, iron, etc.

Even if there were no psycho-physical laws in Davidson’s sense of the term, mightn’t there in fact be plenty of psycho-physical instantiation laws? Perhaps the only way to explain changes in belief or short-term memory is by making generalizations that refer (either implicitly or explicitly) to other beliefs or memories. But it seems perfectly cogent to suppose that, even if this were true, we might be able to explain what it is that makes some particular state of a person (or her neurosystem) a belief or a memory in a purely neurophysiological vocabulary. How would it affect the case for AM if it were to turn out that we could make these sorts of generalizations connecting physical concepts with mentalistic ones?

Upon this topic, opinions diverge quite broadly. Louise Anthony has suggested that, once we recognize the possibility of formulating psycho-physical “instantiation laws,” we will be able to reject statement (3) in a way sensitive to the intuition underlying Davidson’s mountain climber thought experiment. This would, of course, be bad news for the advocate of AM. But Nick Zangwill has suggested that something like the spirit of AM could be preserved even if one were to accept the possibility of what he calls “strict derivative causal laws” (SDLs). Laws of this character, which are quite common in the sciences (according to Zangwill) combine the causal information that instantiations of a property M are followed by instantiations of a property M* with the “metaphysical” information that a system that instantiates M* will do so because it is of type P. It seems easy enough, indeed, to think up putative instances of this type of natural law – consider, for example, the claim that an occurrent general desire for nourishment (M) in a creature whose senses can detect hot oatmeal nearby (P) will normally (ceteris paribus, of course) bring about a more specific desire for oatmeal (M*).

If there are true SDLs that connect up the vocabulary of psychology with the vocabulary of physical science in this sort of way, then there is at least one sense in which statement (3) must clearly be regarded as false. But Zangwill proposes that the defender of AM may still have good grounds for believing that mental phenomena are anomalous in something very much like the way that Davidson originally supposed. For SDLs will generally lack the sort of explanatory significance that “strict” laws of nature, in the Davidsonian sense of the term, may generally be thought to have. They are clearly not the sorts of generalizations that could be conclusively verified without appeal to a background theory consisting at least for the most part of more simply structured law-like generalizations. Furthermore, the underlying physical properties referred to within putatively psycho-physical SDLs are likely to be so wildly disjunctive in nature that such “laws” might normally end up covering nothing more than a single actual instance of mental causation [see Zangwill, 1993, pp. 69-76].

There do, then, appear to be a wide variety of claims that differ both in content and in logical form, but which may nonetheless be entirely plausible candidates for the status of laws of nature. But then from whence comes the surprisingly powerful conviction shared by Davidson and his sympathizers of the falsity of statement (3)? It is impossible to understand why Davidson subscribes to this radical view without becoming acquainted with his views about the norms of empirical methodology that govern all forms of humanistic enquiry. An examination of what he says upon this general subject will therefore help to shed light upon what motivates him to claim that the concepts referred to by mental and physical predicates are simply not ‘made for’ one another.

5. A Methodological Postscript

The extent to which Davidson’s commitment to AM turns out to derive from his views about methodology is partly obscured by his own tendency (shared by the majority of both his followers and his critics) to discuss issues connected with the mind/body problem in traditionally metaphysical terms. But whenever he actually sets about the task of defending statement (1), what is at issue always turns out to be a distinctively methodological question. When we set about explaining the actions of other human beings, to what extent must we employ our own, perhaps entirely parochial, standards for determining what counts as rational behavior?

In his discussion of the two mountain climbers, for example, the identification of the second climber’s decision to let his companion fall as mental causation serves the purpose of providing us with a means for ascribing responsibility. And one could think up other scenarios with relative ease within which the same sort of appeal to the causal efficacy of the mental could be used to bolster our intuitions about an agent’smoral praiseworthiness, his independence from physical coercion or his very sanity. It is this cluster of distinctly normative concepts that seem to represent the principal ingredients in our everyday concept of rationality.

Once one understands this feature of Davidson’s philosophical program, it becomes considerably clearer what is really going on in the two analogies from “Mental Events,” that is, his comparison of the mental/physical distinction in metaphysics to the difference between semantics and syntax and to the failure of behaviorism to supplant belief/desire psychology. Because the methodology whereby radically unfamiliar languages may be interpreted requires us to treat the speakers of these languages as predominantly rational, for Davidson semantics cannot be reduced to syntax [Davidson, 1973b, pp. 134-137]. And it is because the attribution of rationally ordered beliefs and desires is a constitutive feature of all psychological explanation that this pair of concepts are not susceptible to the sorts of reductive accounts sought by the “definitional behaviorist.” Davidson’s belief in the impossibility of fitting together mental and physicalistic concepts into statements that express strict laws of nature is just one more instance of this general pattern of insisting upon a rigorous distinction between descriptive and normative considerations in scientific methodology.

New problems will of course arise for the defender of AM who treats it as a straightforward consequence of these sorts of methodological considerations. It might, for example, be protested that considerations to do with the a priori, constitutive constraints that govern the interpretation of human speech, thought, and action have no obvious implications at all when it comes to assessing the plausibility of statement (3). Philosophers have, after all, had widely divergent intuitions about just what the connection might be between such normative injunctions and the laws of nature. Kim, for example, suggests that if the relevant constraints upon human ethology are as different from those that operate in the rest of the sciences as Davidson thinks they are, then there should surely be no true law-like generalizations – strict or non-strict – connecting mental properties with physical ones [Kim, 1993, p. 25]. Whereas Blackburn remarks that there seems to be no intrinsic reason to suppose that “interesting laws” could be discovered even between properties the attribution of which “answers to different constraints.” [Blackburn, 1985, p. 140]

Other more general worries arise in connection with the very idea that the concept of causation has a distinctive sort of usefulness in explicitly normative contexts. This belief of Davidson’s makes it look as though he might, after all, be implicitly committed to a type of causal rationalism. For suppose our claim that the malicious climber’s deliberate decision to cut his comrade loose caused the latter’s death is partially underwritten by the sorts of normative considerations that Davidson identifies. Our very decision to describe the climber as having deliberated at all, then, will have been partly motivated by our felt need to hold him responsible for the death of his comrade.

But in this case, our descriptions of the cause and of the effect would appear to lack the sort of logical independence from one another that true causal statements are usually (or at least common-sensically) required to have. This observation does not by itself represent a straightforward refutation of Davidson’s position – after all, as we have seen, causal rationalism was openly embraced by Spinoza, as well as by many other philosophers of the early Enlightenment. But it does make Davidson’s views about causation start to look very strange to contemporary sensibilities.

It appears as though coming to a final verdict upon the plausibility of AM would require one to engage in some much more general reflections about the relationship between how we go about obtaining our beliefs about the world – specifically the parts of it that are relevant to the aspiring interpreter of human thought and language – and what sorts of beings that world objectively contains. That we find ourselves faced with this daunting prospect when we try to determine the prospects for achieving a reconciliation of statements (1)-(3) is perhaps something of a disappointment. But it should also perhaps not surprise one too much. The general problem of discerning where the boundary lies between epistemology and metaphysics is, after all, just one more part of the Cartesian legacy.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Anthony, Louise, “Anomalous Monism and the Problem of Explanatory Force,” The Philosophical Review vol. 48 (1989), 153-187.
  • Anthony, Louise, “The Inadequacy of Anomalous Monism as A Realist Theory of Mind,” in G. Preyer et. al (eds.) Language, Mind and Epistemology: On Donald Davidson’s Philosophy (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1994), 223-253.
  • Bennett, Jonathan, A Study of Spinoza’s Ethics (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1984).
  • Blackburn, Simon, “Supervenience Revisited,” reprinted in Essays in Quasi-Realism (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993), 130-148. First published in 1985.
  • Cartwright, Nancy, “Fundamentalism versus the Patchwork of Laws,” Proceedings from the Aristotelian Society 94 (1994), 279-292.
  • Cummins, Robert, The Nature of Psychological Explanation (Cambridge, Mass.: The MIT Press, 1981).
  • Davidson, Donald, “The Logical Form of Action Sentences,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events(Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 105-149. First published in 1967.
  • Davidson, Donald, “The Individuation of Events,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 163-180. First published in 1969.
  • Davidson, Donald, “Mental Events,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 207-224. First published in 1970.
  • Davidson, Donald, “Freedom to Act,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 63-82. First published in 1973.
  • Davidson, Donald, “Radical Interpretation,” reprinted in Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation(Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1984), 125-150. First published in 1973 (b).
  • Davidson, Donald, “Psychology as Philosophy,” reprinted in Essays on Actions and Events (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1980), 229-239. First published in 1974.
  • Davidson, Donald, “Thinking Causes,” in John Heil and Alfred Mele (eds.) Mental Causation (Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1993), 3-18.
  • Fodor, Jerry, “Special Sciences (or, the Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis),” Synthese 28 (1974), 97-115.
  • Honderich, Ted, “The Argument for Anomalous Monism,” Analysis 16 (1982), 59-64.
  • Hornsby, Jennifer, Simple Mindedness (Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press, 1997).
  • Kim, Jaegwon, “Concepts of Supervenience” reprinted in Supervenience and Mind (New York: Cambridge University Press, 1993), 53-78. First published in 1984.
  • Kim, Jaegwon, “Supervenience as a Philosophical Concept,” Metaphilosophy 20 (1990), 1-27.
  • Kim, Jaegwon, “Can Supervenience Save Anomalous Monism?” in John Heil and Alfred Mele (eds.)Mental Causation (Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1993), 19-27.
  • McLaughlin, Brian, “On Davidson’s Response to the Charge of Epiphenomenalism in John Heil and Alfred Mele (eds.) Mental Causation (Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1993), 27-41.
  • Spinoza, Benedict de, Ethics, James Gutmann, ed. (New York: Hafner, 1949).
  • Van Brakel, J., “Supervenience and Anomalous Monism,” Dialectica 53 (1999), 3-24.
  • Zangwill, Nick, “Supervenience and Anomalous Monism: Blackburn On Davidson,” Philosophical Studies 71 (1993), 59-79.

Author Information

Mark Silcox
Auburn University
U. S. A.

Solipsism and the Problem of Other Minds

Solipsism is sometimes expressed as the view that "I am the only mind which exists," or "My mental states are the only mental states." However, the sole survivor of a nuclear holocaust might truly come to believe in either of these propositions without thereby being a solipsist. Solipsism is therefore more properly regarded as the doctrine that, in principle, "existence" means for me my existence and that of my mental states. Existence is everything that I experience -- physical objects, other people, events and processes -- anything that would commonly be regarded as a constituent of the space and time in which I coexist with others and is necessarily construed by me as part of the content of my consciousness. For the solipsist, it is not merely the case that he believes that his thoughts, experiences, and emotions are, as a matter of contingent fact, the only thoughts, experiences, and emotions. Rather, the solipsist can attach no meaning to the supposition that there could be thoughts, experiences, and emotions other than his own. In short, the true solipsist understands the word "pain," for example, to mean "my pain."  He cannot accordingly conceive how this word is to be applied in any sense other than this exclusively egocentric one.

Table of Contents

  1. The Importance of the Problem
  2. Historical Origins of the Problem
  3. The Argument from Analogy
  4. The Physical and the Mental
  5. Knowing Other Minds
  6. The Privacy of Experience
  7. The Incoherence of Solipsism
  8. References and Further Reading

1. The Importance of the Problem

No great philosopher has espoused solipsism. As a theory, if indeed it can be termed such, it is clearly very far removed from common sense. In view of this, it might reasonably be asked why the problem of solipsism should receive any philosophical attention. There are two answers to this question. First, while no great philosopher has explicitly espoused solipsism, this can be attributed to the inconsistency of much philosophical reasoning. Many philosophers have failed to accept the logical consequences of their own most fundamental commitments and preconceptions. The foundations of solipsism lie at the heart of the view that the individual gets his own psychological concepts (thinking, willing, perceiving, and so forth.) from "his own cases," that is by abstraction from "inner experience."

This view, or some variant of it, has been held by a great many, if not the majority of philosophers since Descartes made the egocentric search for truth the primary goal of the critical study of the nature and limits of knowledge.

In this sense, solipsism is implicit in many philosophies of knowledge and mind since Descartes and any theory of knowledge that adopts the Cartesian egocentric approach as its basic frame of reference is inherently solipsistic.

Second, solipsism merits close examination because it is based upon three widely entertained philosophical presuppositions, which are themselves of fundamental and wide-ranging importance. These are: (a) What I know most certainly are the contents of my own mind - my thoughts, experiences, affective states, and so forth.; (b) There is no conceptual or logically necessary link between the mental and the physical. For example, there is no necessary link between the occurrence of certain conscious experiences or mental states and the "possession" and behavioral dispositions of a body of a particular kind; and (c) The experiences of a given person are necessarily private to that person.

These presuppositions are of unmistakable Cartesian origin, and are widely accepted by philosophers and non-philosophers alike. In tackling the problem of solipsism, one immediately grapples with fundamental issues in the philosophy of mind. However spurious the problem of solipsism per se may strike one, these latter issues are unquestionably important. Indeed, one of the merits of the entire enterprise is the extent that it reveals a direct connection between apparently unexceptionable and certainly widely-held common sense beliefs and the acceptance of solipsistic conclusions. If this connection exists and we wish to avoid those solipsistic conclusions, we shall have no option but to revise, or at least to critically review, the beliefs from which they derive logical sustenance.

2. Historical Origins of the Problem

In introducing "methodic doubt" into philosophy, René Descartes created the backdrop against which solipsism subsequently developed and was made to seem, if not plausible, at least irrefutable. For the ego that is revealed by the cogito is a solitary consciousness, a res cogitans that is not spatially extended, is not necessarily located in any body, and can be assured of its own existence exclusively as a conscious mind. (Discourse on Method and the Meditations). This view of the self is intrinsically solipsistic and Descartes evades the solipsistic consequences of his method of doubt by the desperate expedient of appealing to the benevolence of God. Since God is no deceiver, he argues, and since He has created man with an innate disposition to assume the existence of an external, public world corresponding to the private world of the "ideas" that are the only immediate objects of consciousness, it follows that such a public world actually exists. (Sixth Meditation). Thus does God bridge the chasm between the solitary consciousness revealed by methodic doubt and the intersubjective world of public objects and other human beings?

A modern philosopher cannot evade solipsism under the Cartesian picture of consciousness without accepting the function attributed to God by Descartes (something few modern philosophers are willing to do). In view of this it is scarcely surprising that we should find the specter of solipsism looming ever more threateningly in the works of Descartes' successors in the modern world, particularly in those of the British empiricist tradition.

Descartes' account of the nature of mind implies that the individual acquires the psychological concepts that he possesses "from his own case," that is that each individual has a unique and privileged access to his own mind, which is denied to everyone else. Although this view utilizes language and employs conceptual categories ("the individual," "other minds," and so forth.) that are inimical to solipsism, it is nonetheless fundamentally conducive historically to the development of solipsistic patterns of thought. On this view, what I know immediately and with greatest certainty are the events that occur in my own mind - my thoughts, my emotions, my perceptions, my desires, and so forth. - and these are not known in this way by anyone else. By the same token, it follows that I do not know other minds in the way that I know my own; indeed, if I am to be said to know other minds at all - that they exist and have a particular nature - it can only be on the basis of certain inferences that I have made from what is directly accessible to me, the behavior of other human beings.

The essentials of the Cartesian view were accepted by John Locke, the father of modern British empiricism. Rejecting Descartes' theory that the mind possesses ideas innately at birth, Locke argued that all ideas have their origins in experience. "Reflection" (that is introspection or "inner experience") is the sole source of psychological concepts. Without exception, such concepts have their genesis in the experience of the corresponding mental processes. (Essay Concerning Human Understanding II.i.4ff). If I acquire my psychological concepts by introspecting upon my own mental operations, then it follows that I do so independently of my knowledge of my bodily states. Any correlation that I make between the two will be effected subsequent to my acquisition of my psychological concepts. Thus, the correlation between bodily and mental stated is not a logically necessary one. I may discover, for example, that whenever I feel pain my body is injured in some way, but I can discover this factual correlation only after I have acquired the concept "pain." It cannot therefore be part of what I mean by the word "pain" that my body should behave in a particular way.

3. The Argument from Analogy

What then of my knowledge of the minds of others? On Locke's view there can be only one answer: since what I know directly is the existence and contents of my own mind, it follows that my knowledge of the minds of others, if I am to be said to possess such knowledge at all, has to be indirect and analogical, an inference from my own case. This is the so-called "argument from analogy" for other minds, which empiricist philosophers in particular who accept the Cartesian account of consciousness generally assume as a mechanism for avoiding solipsism. (Compare J. S. Mill, William James, Bertrand Russell, and A. J. Ayer).

Observing that the bodies of other human beings behave as my body does in similar circumstances, I can infer that the mental life and series of mental events that accompany my bodily behavior are also present in the case of others. Thus, for example, when I see a problem that I am trying unsuccessfully to solve, I feel myself becoming frustrated and observe myself acting in a particular way. In the case of another, I observe only the first and last terms of this three-term sequence and, on this basis, I infer that the "hidden" middle term, the feeling of frustration, has also occurred.

There are, however, fundamental difficulties with the argument from analogy. First, if one accepts the Cartesian account of consciousness, one must, in all consistency, accept its implications. One of these implications, as we have seen above, is that there is no logically necessary connection between the concepts of "mind" and "body;" my mind may be lodged in my body now, but this is a matter of sheer contingency. Mind need not become located in body. Its nature will not be affected in any way by the death of this body and there is no reason in principle why it should not have been located in a body radically different from a human one. By exactly the same token, any correlation that exists between bodily behavior and mental states must also be entirely contingent; there can be no conceptual connections between the contents of a mind at a given time and the nature and/or behavior of the body in which it is located at that time.

This raises the question as to how my supposed analogical inferences to other minds are to take place at all. How can I apply psychological concepts to others, if I know only that they apply to me? To take a concrete example again, if I learn what "pain" means by reference to my own case, then I will understand "pain" to mean "my pain" and the supposition that pain can be ascribed to anything other than myself will be unintelligible to me.

If the relationship between having a human body and a certain kind of mental life is as contingent as the Cartesian account of mind implies, it should be equally easy - or equally difficult - for me to conceive of a table as being in pain as it is for me to conceive of another person as being in pain. The point, of course, is that this is not so. The supposition that a table might experience pain is a totally meaningless one, whereas the ascription of pain to other human beings and animals that, in their physical characteristics and/or behavioral capabilities, resemble human beings is something which even very young children find unproblematic. (Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, I. § 284).

How is this to be accounted for? It will not do, in this context, to simply respond that a table does not have the same complex set of physical characteristics as a human body or that it is not capable of the same patterns of behavior as a human body. Because the Cartesian position implies that there is no logical connection between the mental and the physical, between the possession of a body of a particular kind and the capability for consciousness. Physical differentiation can and must be acknowledged, but it can play no role in any explanation of what it is to have a mental life.

I am surrounded by other bodies, some of which are similar to mine, and some of which are different. On Cartesian principles such similarities and such differences are irrelevant. The question as to whether it is legitimate for me to ascribe psychological predicates to entities other than myself, which the argument from analogy is designed to address, cannot hinge on the kind of body that I am confronted at a given time. Malcolm, N. (a)).

Assuming the validity of the Cartesian position, we have to infer that it makes as much or a little sense, on these premises, to attribute any psychological predicate to another human being as it does to attribute it to a table or a rock.

On these premises, it makes no sense to attribute consciousness to another human being at all. Thus on strict Cartesian principles, the argument from analogy will not do the work that is required of it to bridge the gulf between my conscious states and putative conscious states that are not mine. Ultimately, it must be confessed that on these principles I know only my own mental states and the supposition that there are mental states other than my own ceases to be intelligible to me. It is thus that solipsism comes to seem inescapable.

If the above argument is valid, it demonstrates that the acceptance of the Cartesian account of consciousness and the view that my understanding of psychological concepts derives, as do the concepts themselves, from my own case leads inexorably to solipsism. However, it may fairly be said that the argument accomplishes more than just this. It can, and should, be understood as a reductio ad absurdum refutation of these Cartesian principles. Viewed from this perspective, the argument may be paraphrased as follows:

If there is no logical connection between the physical and the mental, if the physical forms no part of the criteria that govern my ascription of psychological predicates, then I would be able to conceive of an inanimate object such as a table as having a soul and being conscious. But I cannot attach any intelligibility to the notion of an inanimate object being conscious. It follows therefore that there is a logical connection between the physical and the mental: the physical does form part of the criteria that govern my ascription of psychological words.

4. The Physical and the Mental

What then is this logical connection between the physical and the mental? This question can best be answered by reflecting, for example, on how a cartoonist might show that a particular table was angry or in pain. As indicated above, it is impossible to attach literal meaning to the assertion that a given inanimate object is angry or in pain, but clearly a certain imaginative latitude may be allowed for specific purposes and a cartoonist might conceivably want to picture a table as being angry for humorous reasons.

What is significant in this connection, however, is that to achieve this effect, the cartoonist must picture the table as having human features - the pictured table will appear angry to us only to the extent to that it possesses the natural human expression of anger. The concept of anger can find purchase in relation to the table only if it is represented as possessing something like a human form. This example demonstrates a point of quite fundamental importance: so far from being acquired by abstraction from my own case, from my own "inner" mental life, my psychological concepts are acquired in a specifically intersubjective, social, linguistic context and part of their meaning is their primary application to living human beings. To put this slightly differently, a person is a living human being and the human person in this sense functions as our paradigm of that which has a mental life; it is precisely in relation to their application to persons that we learn such concepts as "consciousness," "pain," "anger," and so forth. As such, it is a necessary and antecedent condition for the ascription of psychological predicates such as these to an object that it should "possess" a body of a particular kind.

Wittgenstein articulated this point in one of the centrally important methodological tenets of the Investigations:

Only of a living human being and what resembles (behaves like) a living human being can one say: it has sensations; it sees; is blind; hears; is deaf; is conscious or unconscious. (I. § 281).

Consequently, the belief that there is something problematic about the application of psychological words to other human beings and that such applications are necessarily the products of highly fallible inferences to the "inner" mental lives of others, which require something like the argument from analogy for their justification, turns out to be fundamentally confused. The intersubjective world that we live with other human beings and the public language-system that we must master if we are to think at all are the primary data, the "proto-phenomena," in Wittgenstein's phrase. (I. § 654) Our psychological and non-psychological concepts alike are derived from a single linguistic fountainhead. It is precisely because the living human being functions as our paradigm of that which is conscious and has a mental life that we find the solipsistic notion that other human beings could be "automatons," machines devoid of any conscious thought or experience, bizarre and bewildering. The idea that other persons might all in reality be "automatons" is not one which we can seriously entertain.

5. Knowing Other Minds

We are now in a position to see the essential redundancy of the argument from analogy. First, it is a misconception to think that we need any inferential argument to assure us of the existence of other minds. Such an assurance seems necessary only so long as it is assumed that each of us has to work "outwards" from the interiority of his/her own consciousness, to abstract from our own cases to the "internal" world of others. As indicated above, this assumption is fundamentally wrong - our knowledge that other human beings are conscious and our knowledge of their mental states at a given time is not inferential in nature at all, but is rather determined by the public criteria that govern the application of psychological concepts. I know that a person who behaves in a particular way - who, for example, gets red in the face, shouts, gesticulates, speaks vehemently, and so forth - is angry precisely because I have learned the concept "anger" by reference to such behavioral criteria. There is no inference involved here. I do not reason "he behaves in this way, therefore he is angry" - rather "behaving in this way" is part of what it is to be angry and it does not occur to any sane person to question whether the individual who acts in this way is conscious or has a mental life. (Investigations, I. § 303; II. iv., p. 178).

Second, because the argument from analogy treats the existence of the mental lives of other living human beings as problematic, it seeks to establish that it is legitimate to infer that other living human beings do indeed have mental lives, that each one of us may be said to be justified
in his confidence that he is surrounded by other persons rather than "automatons." The difficulty here, however, is that the argument presupposes that I can draw an analogy between two things, myself as a person and other living human beings, that are sufficiently similar to permit the analogous comparison and sufficiently different to require it. The question must be faced, however, is how or in what respects am I different from or similar to other human beings? The answer is that I am neither. I am a living human being, as are these others. I see about me living human beings and the argument from analogy is supposed to allow me to infer that these are persons like myself. However, the truth is that I have no criterion for discriminating living human beings from persons, for the very good reason that persons are living human beings - there is no conceptual difference between the two. Since the argument acknowledges that I know living human beings directly, it thereby implicitly acknowledges that I know other persons directly, thus making itself functionally redundant. (Malcolm, N. op. cit.).

A final, frequently-encountered objection to the argument from analogy derives from the work of Strawson and Malcolm: the argument attempts to move inferentially from my supposed direct knowledge of my own mental life and "inner" states to my indirect knowledge of the mental states of others. It thus presupposes that I know what it means to assign mental states to myself without necessarily knowing what it means to ascribe them to others. This is incoherent. To speak of certain mental states as being mine in the first place is to discriminate them from mental states that are not mine and these, by definition, are the mental states of others. It follows, therefore, that in a fundamental sense the argument from analogy cannot get off the ground: one cannot know how to ascribe mental states to oneself unless one also knows what it means to ascribe mental states to others.

Plausible as this objection seems at first sight, it is (ironically, on Wittgensteinian criteria) quite mistaken. For it is not the case that when I am in pain I first identify the pain and subsequently come to recognize that it is one that I, as distinct from someone else, have. The personal pronoun "I" in the locution "I am in pain" is not the "I" of personal individuation - it does not refer to me or discriminate me as a publicly situated person as distinct from others. (The Blue Book and Brown Books, pp. 67-69; also Investigations, I. § 406). The exponent of the argument from analogy is not guilty of the charge of presupposing the very thing that he is endeavoring to demonstrate, as both Strawson and Malcolm suggest. Wittgenstein in fact considered that there is a genuine asymmetry here, in relation to the ascription of psychological predicates to oneself and to others, which is dimly perceived but misrepresented by those who feel the need of the argument from analogy. Whereas one ascribes psychological states to others by reference to bodily and behavioral criteria, one has and requires no criteria at all to self-ascribe or self-avow them. (Investigations, I. § 289-290).

Thus the exponent of the argument from analogy sees, quite correctly, that present-tense, first-person psychological assertions such as "I am in pain" differ radically from third-person psychological predicate ascriptions, but thinks of the former as descriptions of "inner" mental states to which he alone has a privileged access. This is crucially wrong. Such uses of the word "I" as occur in present-tense, first-person psychological assertions do not identify a possessor; they do not discriminate one person from amongst a group. As Wittgenstein puts it,

To say "I have pain" is no more a statement about a particular person than moaning is. (The Blue Book and Brown Books, p. 67; also Investigations, I. § 404.).

To ascribe pain to a third party, on the other hand, is to identify a concrete individual as the possessor of the pain. On this point alone Wittgenstein concurs with the exponent of the argument from analogy. However, Wittgenstein here calls attention to the fact that the asymmetry is not one that exists between the supposedly direct and certain knowledge that I have of my own mental states as distinct from the wholly inferential knowledge which, allegedly, I have of the mental states of others. Rather, the asymmetry is that the ascriptions of psychological predicates to others require criterial justificatory grounds, whereas the self-avowals or self-ascriptions of such predicates are criterionless. It thus transpires that the argument from analogy appears possible and necessary only to those who misapprehend the asymmetry between the criterial bases for third-person psychological predicate ascription and the non-criterial right for their self-ascription or self-avowal for a cognitive asymmetry between direct and indirect knowledge of mental states. The Cartesian egocentric view of the mind and of mental events that gives rise both to the specter of solipsism and attempts to evade it by means of the argument from analogy has its origins in this very misapprehension.

6. The Privacy of Experience

What then of solipsism? To what extent does the foregoing undermine it as a coherent philosophical hypothesis, albeit one in which no-one really believes? Solipsism rests upon certain presuppositions about the mind and our knowledge of mental events and processes. Two of these, the thesis that I have a privileged form of access to and knowledge of my own mind and the thesis that there is no conceptual or logically necessary link between the mental and the physical, have been dealt with above. If the foregoing is correct, both theses are false. This leaves us with the final presupposition underlying solipsism, that all experiences are necessarily (that is logically) private to the individual whose experiences they are. This thesis - which, it is fair to say, is very widely accepted - also derives from the Cartesian account of mind and generates solipsistic conclusions by suggesting that experience is something that, because of its "occult" or ephemeral nature, can never literally be shared. No two people can ever be said to have the same experience. This again introduces the problem of how one person can know the experiences of another or, more radically, how one can know that another person has experiences at all.

Wittgenstein offers a comprehensive critique of this view. He attacks the notion that experience is necessarily private. His arguments against this are complex, if highly compressed and rather oracular. (For more detailed accounts, see Kenny, A., Malcolm, N. (b), Vohra, A.).

Wittgenstein distinguishes two senses of the word "private" as it is normally used: privacy of knowledge and privacy of possession. Something is private to me in the first sense if only I can know it; it is private to me in the second sense if only I can have it. Thus the thesis that experience is necessarily private can mean one of two things, which are not always discriminated from each other with sufficient care: (a) only I can know my experiences or (b) only I can have my experiences. Wittgenstein argues that the first of these is false and the second is true in a sense that does not make experience necessarily private, as follows:

Under (a), if we take pain as an experiential exemplar, we find that the assertion "Only I can know my pains" is a conjunction of two separate theses: (i) I (can) know that I am in pain when I am in pain and (ii) other people cannot know that I am in pain when I am in pain. Thesis (i) is, literally, nonsense: it cannot be meaningfully asserted of me that I know that I am in pain. Wittgenstein's point here is not that I do not know that I am in pain when I am in pain, but rather that the word "know" cannot be significantly employed in this way. (Investigations, I. § 246; II. xi. p. 222). This is because the verbal locution "I am in pain" is usually (though not invariably) an expression of pain - as part of acquired pain-behavior it is a linguistic substitute for such natural expressions of pain as groaning. (I. § 244). For this reason it cannot be governed by an epistemic operator. The prepositional function "I know that x" does not yield a meaningful proposition if the variable is replaced by an expression of pain, linguistic or otherwise. Thus to say that others learn of my pains only from my behavior is misleading, because it suggests that I learn of them otherwise, whereas I don't learn of them at all - I have them. (I. § 246).

Thesis (ii) - other people cannot know that I am in pain when I am in pain - is false. If we take the word "know" is as it is normally used, then it is true to say that other people can and very frequently do know when I am in pain. Indeed, in cases where the pain is extreme, it is often impossible to prevent others from knowing this even when one wishes to do so. Thus, in certain circumstances, it would not be unusual to hear it remarked of someone, for example, that "a moan of pain escaped him" - indicating that despite his efforts, he could not but manifest his pain to others. It thus transpires that neither thesis (i) nor (ii) is true.

If we turn to (b), we find that "Only I can have my pains" expresses a truth, but it is a truth that is grammatical rather than ontological. It draws our attention to the grammatical connection between the personal pronoun "I" and the possessive "my." However, it tells us nothing specifically about pains or other experiences, for it remains true if we replace the word "pains" with many other plural nouns (e.g. "Only I can have my blushes"). Another person can have the same pain as me. If our pains have the same phenomenal characteristics and corresponding locations, we will quite correctly be said to have "the same pain." This is what the expression "the same pain" means. Another person, however, cannot have my pains. My pains are the ones that, if they are expressed at all, are expressed by me. But by exactly the same (grammatical) token, another person cannot have my blushes, sneezes, frowns, fears, and so forth., and none of this can be taken as adding to our stockpile of metaphysical truths. It is true that I may deliberately and successfully keep an experience to myself, in which case that particular experience might be said to be private to me. But I might do this by articulating it in a language that those with whom I was conversing do not understand. There is clearly nothing occult or mysterious about this kind of privacy. (Investigations, II. xi, p. 222). Similarly, experience that I do not or cannot keep to myself is not private. In short, some experiences are private and some are not. Even though some experiences are private in this sense, it does not follow that all experiences could be private. As Wittgenstein points out, "What sometimes happens could always happen" is a fallacy. It does not follow from the fact that some orders are not obeyed that all orders might never be obeyed. For in that case the concept "order" would become incapable of instantiation and would lose its significance. (I. § 345).

7. The Incoherence of Solipsism

With the belief in the essential privacy of experience eliminated as false, the last presupposition underlying solipsism is removed and solipsism is shown as foundationless, in theory and in fact. One might even say, solipsism is necessarily foundationless, for to make an appeal to logical rules or empirical evidence the solipsist would implicitly have to affirm the very thing that he purportedly refuses to believe: the reality of intersubjectively valid criteria and a public, extra-mental world. There is a temptation to say that solipsism is a false philosophical theory, but this is not quite strong or accurate enough. As a theory, it is incoherent. What makes it incoherent, above all else, is that the solipsist requires a language (that is a sign-system) to think or to affirm his solipsistic thoughts at all. Given this, it is scarcely surprising that those philosophers who accept the Cartesian premises that make solipsism apparently plausible, if not inescapable, have also invariably assumed that language-usage is itself essentially private. The cluster of arguments - generally referred to as "the private language argument" - that we find in the Investigations against this assumption effectively administers the coup de grâce to both Cartesian dualism and solipsism. (I. § 202; 242-315). Language is an irreducibly public form of life that is encountered in specifically social contexts. Each natural language-system contains an indefinitely large number of "language-games," governed by rules that, though conventional, are not arbitrary personal fiats. The meaning of a word is its (publicly accessible) use in a language. To question, argue, or doubt is to utilize language in a particular way. It is to play a particular kind of public language-game. The proposition "I am the only mind that exists" makes sense only to the extent that it is expressed in a public language, and the existence of such language itself implies the existence of a social context. Such a context exists for the hypothetical last survivor of a nuclear holocaust, but not for the solipsist. A non-linguistic solipsism is unthinkable and a thinkable solipsism is necessarily linguistic. Solipsism therefore presupposes the very thing that it seeks to deny. That solipsistic thoughts are thinkable in the first instance implies the existence of the public, shared, intersubjective world that they purport to call into question.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ayer, A. J. The Problem of Knowledge. Penguin, 1956.
  • Beck, K. "De re Belief and Methodological Solipsism," in Thought and Object - Essays in Intentionality (ed. A. Woodfield). Clarendon Press, 1982.
  • Dancy, J. Introduction to Contemporary Epistemology. Blackwell, 1985.
  • Descartes, R. Discourse on Method and the Meditations (trans. F. E. Sutcliffe). Penguin, 1968.
  • Devitt, M. Realism and Truth. Blackwell, 1984.
  • Hacker, P.M.S. Insight and Illusion. O.U.P., 1972.
  • James, W. Radical Empiricism and a Pluralistic Universe. E.P. Dutton, 1971.
  • Kenny, A. Wittgenstein. Penguin, 1973.
  • Locke, J. Essay Concerning Human Understanding (ed. A.C. Fraser), Dover, 1959.
  • Malcolm, N. (a) Problems of Mind: Descartes to Wittgenstein, Allen & Unwin, 1971.
  • Malcolm, N. (b) Thought and Knowledge. Cornell University Press, 1977.
  • Mill, J.S. An Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy. Longmans Green (6th ed.), 1889.
  • Oliver, W.D. "A Sober Look at Solipsism," Studies in the Theory of Knowledge (ed. N. Rescher). Blackwell, 1970.
  • Pinchin, C. Issues in Philosophy. Macmillan, 1990.
  • Quine, W.V. (a) "The Scope of Language in Science," The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays. Random House, 1966.
  • Quine, W.V. (b) "Epistemology Naturalized," Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. Columbia University Press, 1969.
  • Russell, B. Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits. Allen & Unwin, 1948.
  • Strawson, P.F. Individuals, an Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics. Methuen, 1959.
  • Vohra, A. Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Mind. Croom Helm, 1986.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (a) The Blue Book and Brown Books, Blackwell, 1972.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (b) Philosophical Investigations. Blackwell, 1974.

Author Information

Stephen P. Thornton
University of Limerick

Collective Intentionality

The idea that a collective could be bearer of intentional states such as belief and intention is likely to raise some eyebrows, especially in certain Anglo-American and European philosophical circles. The dominant picture in these circles is that intentionality is a feature of individual minds/brains. On the face of it, groups don't have minds or brains. How could they have intentional states?

Despite the initial skepticism, there is a growing number of philosophers turning their attention to the issue of collective intentionality. The focus of these recent discussions has been primarily on the notions of collective intention and belief. Philosophers of action theory have been interested in collective intentions because of their interest in understanding collective or group agency. Individual intentions shape and inform individual actions. My intention guides my daily activities, structures my desires in a variety of ways, and facilitates coordination with both my future self and others around me. But we do not always act alone and it is coordination with others that raises interesting issues regarding the possibility of collective intentions. Many philosophers believe that individual intentions alone will not explain collective action and that joint action requires joint (sometimes called shared or collective in the literature) intentions. An exception to this trend is Seamus Miller who has argued that collective or joint action can be understood in terms of collective ends that are not intentions. Because his positive account of joint action does not appeal to collective intentionality, his work will not be highlighted in this article.

Interest in the notion of collective belief has been motivated, in part, by concerns over how to understand our collective belief ascriptions and the role they play in social scientific theory and everyday contexts. We often attribute beliefs, desires, and other propositional attitudes to groups like corporations. What do these ascriptions mean? Are they to be taken literally?

Table of Contents

  1. Instrumentalism
  2. Summative Accounts
  3. Non-Summative Accounts
    1. Searle
    2. Bratman
    3. Gilbert
    4. Tuomela
  4. Internal Debates: Belief vs. Acceptance
  5. The Role of Collective Intentionality
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Instrumentalism

A common response to the questions that arise concerning our practice of ascribing intentional states to groups is to say that these ascriptions are mere fictions. When we say, "The Federal Reserve believes that interest rates ought to remain low," this does not mean that the Federal Reserve literally has a belief. Rather, we are speaking metaphorically. According to this account, our ascriptions of intentional states to groups, though useful, are, strictly speaking, false.

Although this account has common-sense appeal, it has not been appealing to philosophers working in this area for a variety of reasons. First, our practice of attributing responsibility to organizations (consider, for instance, current tobacco lawsuits) seems to presuppose that organizations literally have intentional states. For we could not hold them legally and morally responsible for an action unless they intended to commit the act. Since we do not hold organizations metaphorically responsible (much to the dismay of tobacco companies), the attributions on which our ascriptions of responsibility rest should be, at least initially, considered non-metaphorical.

Further, our ascriptions of intentional states to groups have a surprising explanatory power. They allow us to predict and explain the actions of groups. Although false ascriptions could be explanatorily powerful (just as false theories are sometimes explanatorily powerful), explanatory power is prima facie evidence that our ascriptions are not simply false. We might also note that if the instrumentalist about collective intentionality is correct, then we, the media, social scientists, lawyers, political scientists, etc. are continually disseminating falsehoods. This seems to be an odd result and again, prima facie, evidence that our ascriptions are not mere metaphors.

It should be noted that rejection of the metaphorical approach to our collective intentional state ascriptions does not necessarily commit one to the view that when we are ascribing intentional states to groups those ascriptions are true in virtue of the fact that there is a collective or group mind that is the bearer of these states. In rejecting the metaphorical approach one need not also reject an individualistic approach. As we shall see there are alternative accounts that hold that these ascriptions are true, not in virtue of there being a group mind, but in virtue of the fact that the individuals within the group have certain intentional states. Summative accounts are of this kind.

2. Summative Accounts

Summative accounts of collective attitude ascription argue that these ascriptions are a short-hand way of referring to the fact that most members have the attitude (and the content) ascribed to the group. This is the view espoused by Anthony Quinton in 'Social Objects' (1975). These accounts have been labeled summative by Margaret Gilbert (1989) because they try to analyze group attitude ascriptions in terms of the sum of individual attitudes with the same content as that ascribed to the group.

There are a variety of summative accounts on offer. For the purposes of this article I will focus on two types, simple summative account (SSA) and the complex summative account (CSA), identified by Margaret Gilbert in her (1987) article "Modelling Collective Belief." According to the simple summative account:

Group G believes that p if and only if all or most of the members believe that p.

A simple summative account of group intention would substitute 'intends' in the formulation above. Gilbert (1987, 1989, 1994) has argued persuasively that this analysis is insufficient. Consider a case in which every member of the philosophy department believes that eating meat is immoral, but the members do not express this opinion because they are afraid of the response they will receive from their colleagues and students. In this context, it is unlikely that we would attribute to the philosophy department the belief that eating meat is immoral. It is possible, of course, to construct a context in which it would be appropriate to attribute such a belief to the philosophy department--perhaps, if the philosophy department were engaged in a discussion of animal rights. But in such a context the beliefs of the individuals would no longer be secret. Presumably, at least some of the members would express their opinions.

This example suggests that group belief depends on certain epistemic features of individuals. The complex summative account acknowledges these epistemic features by introducing the notion of common knowledge. CSA requires that members of the group recognize or know that most of the members in the group believe that p. Thus, CSA is committed to the conceptual truth of the following:

A group G believes that p if and only if (1) most of the members of G believe that p, and (2) it is common knowledge in G that (1).

Gilbert (1989, 1994) has argued that the CSA is too weak. Consider the following example: A company has formed two committees and coincidently the committees have the same exact membership. One committee has been formed in order to develop an office dress code. Call this committee the Dress Code committee. The other committee has been formed to assess the recently installed phone system. Call this committee the Phone committee. Now imagine that (a) every member of the Dress Code committee personally believes that spandex pants are inappropriate apparel for the office and this is common knowledge within the Dress Code committee, and (b) the same goes mutatis mutandis for each member of the Phone committee. It seems compatible with (a) and (b) that (c) the Dress Code committee believes spandex is inappropriate, and (d) the Phone committee does not believe that spandex is appropriate office apparel. Yet the conditions of the CSA have been met for both. Gilbert provides a similar example in (1996, 199). The addition of common knowledge, according to Gilbert, does not provide sufficient conditions for group belief. Although Angelo Corlett (1996) has criticized examples of this sort and has provided a defense of a simple summative account, most theorists agree with Gilbert that the account is insufficient.

In addition to being too weak, many including Gilbert believe that both the CSA and SSA are too strong. On summative accounts it is conceptually necessary for most of the members of G to believe that p in order for G to believe that p. This seems too strong. Indeed, there seem to be contexts in which no group member has the attitude ascribed to the group. Imagine a group of politicians who do not personally believe that partial birth abortion should be outlawed, but because of the pressure exerted by their constituents they vote to ban partial birth abortion. Ascriptions of belief to the group of politicians would probably be made on the basis of this vote and, thus, we would ascribe the belief that partial birth abortion should be banned to the group of politicians even though no individual politician personally believes this proposition.

Group intentions, too, are not easily understood in terms of the summation of individual intentions to perform some action. Consider this example given by John Searle (1990, 403). Imagine a group of people sitting on the grass enjoying a sunny afternoon. Suddenly it grows dark and starts to rain. They all get up and run for shelter. In this scenario each individual has the intention "I am running to shelter" and these intentions are had independently of one another. Now imagine a situation in which their running to the shelter is part of a performance. Suppose they are a group of actors and this is part of a scene in a play. Thus, at one point in the play they perform the same actions done by the individuals in the above scenario. According to Searle, the performance by the actors involves a collective intention in the form "we intend to do x." This collective intention is different from the individual intentions had by the individual actors and it is not captured by summing up individual intentions in the form "I intend to x."

The reason why collective intentions cannot be reduced to individual intentions, argues Searle, is that no set of I-intentions even supplemented with mutual beliefs will add up to a we-intend. Collective intentions involve a sense of acting and willing something together. Individual intentions involved in this enterprise are derived from collective intentions and the individual intentions that are derived from the collective intention will often have a different content from that of the collective intention. Michael Bratman (1999,111) also stresses the inadequacy of summative accounts of group intentions. Consider a case in which you have an intention to paint the house and I have an intention to paint the same house and this is common knowledge between us. The set of intentional states is not enough to guarantee that our actions are coordinated in any manner so that we are painting the house together. Indeed, the complex summative account does not rule out the possibility of our painting the same house at the same time but independent of one another (avoiding the other by chance). The set of individual intentional states identified by the complex summative accounts is not going to play any role in coordinating our behavior so that painting the house is something we do together. Intentions, either collective or individual, do, by their nature, play a role in planning and coordination. (Bratman, 1999, 1987) So, according to this line of reasoning, summative accounts, even of the complex kind, cannot be an adequate account of the nature of collective intention.

3. Non-Summative Accounts

a. Searle

In "Collective Intentions and Actions" (1990) and in The Construction of Social Reality (1995) John Searle defends an account of collective intentionality that is non-summative, but remains individualistic. Searle specifies that anything we say about collective intention must meet the following conditions of adequacy:

  1. It must be consistent with the fact that society is nothing over and above the individuals that comprise it. All consciousness and intentionality is in the minds of individuals. Specifically, individual brains.
  2. It must be consistent with the fact that all intentionality could be had by a brain in a vat.

Searle's first criterion of adequacy denies that groups themselves can be intentional agents and advocates a form of individualism. The second criterion is motivated by atomism. According to this condition, all intentionality, individual or collective, is independent of what the real world is like, since a radical mistake is possible. These two conditions entail that collective intentions exist in individual brains. Thus Searle's position allows for the possibility of a single person having the collective intention "we intend to do x."

...I could have all the intentionality I do have even if I am radically mistaken, even if the apparent presence and cooperation of other people is an illusion, even if I am suffering a total hallucination, even if I am a brain in a vat. (1990, 117)

How is it possible for an individual to have an intention of the form "We intend to J"? Searle contends that this capacity is biologically primitive. Indeed, he suggests that it is shared by a variety of other species. This capacity presupposes other Background capacities (the Background is a technical term for Searle referring to conditions necessary for certain cognitive activities and language). In particular, it presupposes a Background sense of the other as a candidate for cooperative agency (1990, 414).

Collective intentionality plays a large role in Searle's overall account of social reality. In The Construction of Social Reality (1995) collective intentionality is that which confers a function on artifacts and changes them into social facts. Pieces of paper function as money because we intend them to do so. Just as individual intentionality has the ability to change the world via speech acts, collective intentionality has, according to Searle, the ability to create social facts.

Searle's account of collective intention has been criticized for a variety of reasons. First, Tollefsen (2002d) notes that it rests on the controversial assumption that externalist theories of content individuation are false. According to standard externalist reasoning, if a brain in a vat is not in the proper water environment (either in causal contact with water or able to theorize about water) then it cannot have beliefs or intentions about water. The content of a belief is determined by external rather than merely internal aspects. If this is correct then a brain in a vat could not have we-intentions. Further, there are some who argue that one could not even have a concept of another agent if he or she is not part of a social practice of interpretation (Davidson, for instance, 1992). If these views are correct it would be difficult to say how a brain in a vat could have a we-concept at all. One cannot simply assume that these theories are false without a lengthy discussion and refutation. To the extent that Searle's account rests on a controversial thesis in the philosophy of mind and language it is problematic.

Others (Meijers 2001, Gilbert 1998) have argued that Searle's account fails to capture the normative relations that are an integral part of collective intentions. When we form a collective intention, we create obligations and expectations among us. The football players in Searle's example above are obligated to perform certain actions given that they have formed a collective intention to execute a pass play. As Gilbert notes (1989, 1994) if one of the players fails to do his or her part the other players have a right to rebuke their teammate. This rebuke is evidence of the normativity involved in joint action. When we form a collective intention we make commitments and incur obligations. Searle's account, because it essentially allows for solipsistic we-intentions, fails to acknowledge the normativity involved in collective intentionality. For Gilbert and Meijers, the normativity of collective intentionality is essential to the phenomenon.

Searle himself acknowledges that it is because of the special nature of collective intentions that we are able to distinguish between the two cases of individuals running for cover in the example above. There is something about collective intentions that coordinates individual, independent actions into a joint action. But isolated, perhaps even solipsistic, we-intentions do not, in themselves, seem to be enough to direct and coordinate the individual intentional actions of which the joint action is comprised. Suppose, for instance, that none of the actors knew of the other actor's we-intention. It would seem to be a complete accident that they acted together. Indeed, it would seem as fortuitous as a group of individuals that just happen to get up at the same time and run for cover.

b. Bratman

The problems with Searle's account point to the fact that whatever individual intentional states underlie collective intentions, they should be interrelated in a significant way. Michael Bratman provides an account of collective intention in terms of the intentions of the individual participants and their interrelations. His analysis provides a rational reconstruction of what it is for two people to intend to do something together. We should note that Bratman uses the term "shared intention" rather than collective intention.

We need to be careful with this phrase as there are several senses in which one can "share" an intention. You and I, for instance, can both intend to wash the dishes and thus we share, in some sense, the intention to wash the dishes. But these intentions are consistent with our washing the dishes independently of one another. Here is another way to distinguish between the weak and the strong sense of sharing. You and I each have a quarter in our pockets. In this case, one might say that we share "quarter possession." This is the weak sense of sharing. This sense of sharing is to be distinguished from a case in which we share a quarter between us. The weak sense of sharing does not aid us in understanding how people can perform actions together. With this caution in mind, I will use collective intention and shared intention interchangeably to refer to the type of intention that is thought to be crucial for understanding collective actions. The weak sense of shared intention noted above is not a candidate.

Bratman begins his discussion of collective intention by identifying the role that collective or shared intentions play. First, shared intentions help to coordinate our intentional actions. For instance, our shared intention of washing the dishes will guide each of our intentional actions towards satisfying the goal of washing the dishes. Thus, someone will wash the dishes before rinsing them and someone will rinse them before drying them. Second, our shared intention will coordinate our actions by making sure that our own personal plans of action meld together. If I plan to do the washing, then I will check with your plan and see if there is any conflict. Third, shared intentions act as a backdrop against which bargaining and negotiation occur. Conflicts about who does the washing and who does the drying will be resolved by considering the fact that we share the intention to do the dishes. Thus, shared intention unifies and coordinates individual intentional actions by tracking the goals accepted by each individual.

Consider a case in which you and I intend to wash the dishes together. If this intention is a shared intention then it is not a matter of you having an intention to wash the dishes and me having an intention to wash the dishes. Nor is it a matter of each of us having an atomistically conceived we-intention to wash the dishes. Such coincident intentions do not insure that each of us knows of the other's intention and that we are committed to the joint action of washing the dishes together. Further, an explicit promise made to each other does not seem to insure that we share an intention either. Because I might be lying to you and have no intention of washing the dishes with you. Thus, explicit promises are not sufficient for shared intention. Nor are they necessary for shared intention. Bratman provides an example from Hume to highlight this. "Consider Hume's example of two people in a row boat who row together 'tho they have never given promises to each other.' Such rowers may well have a shared intention to row the boat together"(Bratman, 1993, 98-99).

What do shared intentions consist in according to Bratman? Bratman shares Searle's commitment to individualism in that he does not think that shared intentions are the intentions of a plural agent, nor are they to be understood solely in terms of individual intentional states. Shared intentions, according to Bratman, are to be identified with the state of affairs consisting of a set of interrelated individual intentional states. What set of individual attitudes are interrelated in appropriate ways such that the complex consisting of such attitudes would, if functioning properly, do the jobs of shared intention?

Here is a somewhat simplified version of Bratman's answer to this question. We intend to wash the dishes if and only if:

  1. a. I intend that we wash the dishes.
    b. You intend that we wash the dishes.
  2. I intend that we wash the dishes in accordance with and because of 1a and 1b; you intend likewise.
  3. 1 and 2 are common knowledge between us.

It should be noted that the focus in this article is on Bratman's account of the shared intention that underlies joint intentional action. In "Shared Cooperative activity" (1999) Bratman provides an account of the shared intention that underlies more cooperative ventures and it involves conditions 1-3 and some additional conditions that rule out coercion.

As a first approximation, this complex of intentional attitudes above seems plausible. But consider a case in which we each intend to wash the dishes together and we each do so in part because of the other's intention. However, I intend to wash the dishes with Palmolive and you intend to wash them with Joy. All of this is common knowledge and we will not compromise. Is there a collective intention present? It seems not. In this case we do not have our subplans coordinated in the appropriate way. Recall that one of the jobs that shared intention has is to coordinate our individual plans and goals. In the example above our individual subplans are in conflict and this would prevent us from achieving our goal of getting the dishes washed.

Bratman avoids this counterexample by adding a clause about participants' subplans. It is not necessary that our subplans match, but they must mesh. So, if my subplan is to wash the dishes with Palmolive, and your subplan is to wash them with hot water, and I have no preference about the water temperature, then our subplans mesh though they don't match exactly. But if we have subplans to wash the dishes with completely different types of dish detergent then our subplans do not mesh. Bratman reformulates the account in the following way:
We intend to J if and only if:

  1. (a) I intend that we J and (b) you intend that we J
  2. I intend that we J in accordance with and because of 1a and 1b, and meshing subplans of 1a and 1b; you intend the same.
  3. 1 and 2 are common knowledge

This account of collective intentions rejects the atomism of Searle's account. Because a shared intention is the complex of attitudes of individuals and their interrelations, an individual cannot have a shared intention. As we have seen, on Searle's account one can have a shared intention, even if one is a brain in a vat. On Bratman's view the intentions of individuals are interrelated and reflexive in a way that makes solipsistic we-intentions impossible.

Bratman's account of collective or shared intentions has been criticized in a variety of ways. Both Searle and Bratman attempt to avoid the specter of the collective mind. Searle places we-intentions in the mind of individuals. Bratman avoids positing a plural agent by trying to explain collective intentions in terms of individual attitudes with common contents that are distinctively social in the sense that solitary individuals could not have them. But how is it possible for me to have an intention with the form "we-intend" or with the form "I intend that we do J"? There seem to be certain features of intention itself that would rule out both Searle's and Bratman's ways of understanding the notion of joint intention. This line of argument has been developed, in slightly different ways, in recent papers by Annette Baier (1997), Frederick Stoutland (1997), and J. David Velleman (1997). Normally, when I intend to do something, the action I intend to do is under my control. And in normal cases of shared intention (cases where there is no coercion or where I am not in control of your actions), the other agent is seen as being in control of his or her own actions. Further, when I intend to do something, this intention settles, in some sense, what I will do. In Bratman's terms, I have set a plan or course of action for myself. But how, then, can I intend that we do something? There is something in this scenario that is out of my control. My intention that we J cannot settle what we will do, because you have an equally important role in settling what will be done. Thus, I cannot intend that we J.

Stoutland (1997) puts the problem a bit differently by emphasizing that Bratman's attempt to identify a set of individual intentions with common contents is impossible. Because intention makes an implicit reference to the subject that fulfills the intention, there are no intentions with common content. "Art can intend to go to a film and Mary can intend to do the same; but their intentions do not have common content, since Art's intention is his going to the film and Mary's is her going to the film." (1997, 56). Likewise, it would seem impossible for me to have a Searlian we-intention. Because intention makes an implicit reference to the subject that is responsible for fulfilling the intention and I am not a we, I cannot have a we-intention. In cases of joint action I am not the subject that is responsible for fulfilling the intention. In order to be responsible I would have to have the actions of others under my direct control. But I do not. Therefore, I cannot have a we-intention.

In "I intend that we J" (1999) Bratman alters his account of shared intention in an attempt to meet this challenge. Basically, Bratman introduces the technical notion of intending that. This is supposed to be like ordinary intention except that it does not require that the individual with the intention also be the individual who fulfills the intention. I can intend that my children go to college, for instance. On this understanding of intention it seems possible for an individual to have the intention that we X. This way of avoiding the objection has seemed to some to be problematic. First, to intend that my children go to college is simply to intend to do something that brings it about that my children go to college. And these actions (whatever they might be) are under my direct control. This is not so in the case of my intending that we X. Further, Bratman seems to have changed the subject. Intentions are normally intentions to do something.  It is intentions to act that explain behavior at the individual level. If collective actions presuppose intention in the way that individual agency does, then it would seem to be the same sort of intention to that is presupposed. But according to Stoutland and others, Bratman doesn't give us an account of these intentions.

Like Searle, Bratman has been accused of ignoring the normativity of collective intentions. For Gilbert and Meijers, there is a normativity involved in collective intentionality that suggests that collective intentions and other intentional states are essentially commitments of a sort. Consider Gilbert's (1989) example of walking together. We form an intention to walk together and begin our journey. Halfway through the walk you veer off to the left and start walking away from me. If we intended to walk together, this behavior is not only odd but justifiably subject to rebuke. The behavior will be considered to be a violation of some sort of commitment that we made. There seems to be a sense in which you ought not to have done this and I have the right to rebuke you. "Hey" I can say, "we are walking together. Where are you going?" I can take offense at your behavior and, according to Gilbert, my offense is justified and its justification derives from the normative commitments that are inherent in the collective intention.

Bratman's account of collective or shared intentionality does not involve a normative element. For him, cognitive attitudes and their interrelations are enough to explain collective intentionality. Although he admits that certain shared activities will involve obligations, he stresses that it is possible to have a shared intention that does not involve promises or obligations. That is, there is nothing essentially normative about collective intentionality. He does, however, make a further distinction between weak and strong shared intentions, in which the latter involves binding agreement. This normativity inherent in a binding agreement, however, is explained in terms of additional moral principles like Scanlon's (1998) "principle of fidelity."

c. Gilbert

Margaret Gilbert's account of collective intentions and other intentional states like belief aims, in part, to explain the nature of this normative phenomenon without having to postulate additional normative principles. Her account of collective intentionality is also part of a larger project to provide a conceptual analysis of certain group concepts. In On Social Facts (1989), in addition to providing an analysis of the concept of a group belief and intention, she also provides an account of the concept of a social group and the concept of social convention. In doing so, she claims to be uncovering the "core" of such concepts and legitimizing the use of these "everyday" concepts within the social sciences.

Gilbert's account of collective intentionality is closely linked to her account of the concept of a social group. Briefly, our everyday concept of a social group is, according to Gilbert, the concept of a plural subject of belief or action. A plural subject is an entity, or as Gilbert puts it, "a special kind of thing, a 'synthesis sui generis'"(1996, 268) formed when individuals bond or unite in a particular way. This "special kind of thing" can be the subject to which intentional action and psychological attributes are attributed. We can formulate the conceptually necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of plural subjects in the following way:

Individuals A1.....An....form a plural subject of X-ing (for some action X or psychological attribute X) if and only if A1An form a joint commitment to X-ing as a body.

It will be helpful to begin by considering what is involved in a joint commitment to act as a body or as a single individual. We will then consider the plural subject framework as it applies to psychological states like belief.

A joint commitment to act as a body is a commitment made by a collection of individuals to perform some present or future action as would a single individual. Joint commitments are formed when each of a number of people expresses his or her willingness to participate in the relevant joint commitment with the others. Each person understands that only when all of the relevant people have agreed to participate in the joint commitment will the joint commitment be formed. Once every one has agreed, a pool of wills is formed and individuals are then jointly committed. Once the joint commitment is established, each individual is individually obligated to do his or her part to make it the case that he or she acts as a body.

Consider a case in which Joe's construction company agrees to build a house for Mrs. Wilbur. The members of the company do not each individually agree to build Mrs. Wilbur a house. This would lead to the proliferation of Wilbur abodes. They each individually agree, however, to make it the case that the house is built by the construction company and express their willingness to do so on the condition that every other member do the same. This expression of willingness need not be simultaneous. The members may express their willingness over time. Nor do they need to express their willingness verbally. In many cases, silence is an adequate expression of intention. They must, however, in order for the joint commitment to come into existence, communicate in some way and at some point in time their intention to do their part in building the house as a body with others.

Because joint commitments are joint, they cannot simply be reduced to an aggregate of individual commitments. A joint commitment gives rise to certain obligations and entitlements. Members of the group have a right to expect that other members will follow through on their commitments. Sam and Tammy are entitled to expect that Joe will do his part to make it the case that the construction company builds a house for Mrs. Wilbur. If Joe is doing something to frustrate the building process, Sam and Tammy are justified in rebuking him.

A joint commitment can only be rescinded if every member party to the joint commitment agrees to rescind it. The existence of the joint commitments in the face of an individual rescinding his or her individual commitment explains why the members of the construction company have a right to rebuke Joe when he is not doing his part. If Joe says, "I've had enough of this mindless labor," and walks off the site, the joint commitment remains in full force because there has been no agreement among the members to rescind the joint commitment. This does not mean, of course, that the individual commitment Joe makes cannot be broken. It does mean, however, that if he breaks his individual commitment, even for a good reason, this does not nullify the joint commitment and its associated obligations.

According to Gilbert, the obligations which arise from a joint commitment are of a special kind and they differ from other forms of obligations in the following ways: First, although each individual in the group must be "willing" to be jointly committed, this notion of willingness does not, according to Gilbert, rule out coercion. A person can be coerced into being part of a joint commitment and yet it still remains a commitment to which a person is obligated. Gilbert wants to show that joint commitments arise in various environments and under various circumstances. Often joint commitments are coerced because the person who is doing the coercion needs the commitment of others in order to carry through with their actions.

A second aspect that distinguishes the obligations of a joint commitment from other types of obligation is the interdependence of the commitments makes it the case that no one member can rescind a joint commitment. For example, Al's commitment to travel with Doris cannot be dissolved by Al changing his mind. This feature was already noted above.

Third, in becoming party to a joint commitment a person has a reason to act. It is a reason that remains whether or not his or her beliefs or external circumstances change. Joe is obligated to every other member of Joe's construction company to act in accordance with the joint commitment to building a house. This commitment acts as a reason and, if reasons are causes, joint commitments can often explain why individuals act in particular circumstances. It is a reason that remains and will bind him to acting appropriately until the group as a whole decides to release one another from this obligation.

Finally, the people party to a joint commitment are aware of the obligations they have to one another. They could not be held responsible for violation of such obligations unless they were aware of these obligations. The fact that every other member has committed herself to the joint commitment is common knowledge, and there is also common knowledge of the obligations, expectations, and entitlements that arise from such commitments.

Having discussed the notion of forming a joint commitment to act as a body, we are now in a position to apply the plural subject schema to belief:

Individuals A1...An... form a plural subject of believing that p if and only if A1...An form a joint commitment to believe that p as a body.

Recall that joint commitments are commitments of groups, not individuals. They arise, in the case of joint action, when each individual expresses his willingness to do his part provided that every other individual commits to doing her part to bring it about that they perform some action as a body. Gilbert simply extends this analysis of joint action to group belief. Individuals express their willingness to do their part to make the case that they believe as a body. These commitments and expectations are common knowledge. This set of reciprocal intentions and commitments sets up the pool of wills and certain obligations and entitlements then come into play. But what is required in doing one's part to make it the case that they believe that p as a body?

Gilbert makes it clear that members do not have to themselves believe that p. This allows her to avoid the pitfalls of the summative accounts. They also do not have to act as if they personally believe that p. Doing one's part in the context of a joint belief, then, seems to involve at least not saying anything contrary to the group belief while speaking as a member of the group or acting contrary to the group belief while acting in one's capacity as a group member. One who participates in a joint commitment to believe that p thereby accepts an obligation to do what he can to bring it about that any joint endeavors among the members of the group be conducted on the assumption that p is true. He is entitled to expect others' support in bringing this about. Further, if one does believe something that is inconsistent with p, one is required at least not to express that belief baldly. The committee members would have a right to rebuke one of their own if, in acting as a member of the committee, he or she expressed views that were contrary to the group view without prefacing his or her remarks with "I personally believe that..."

According to Gilbert, then, when individuals form a plural subject of belief, (i.e., when they become party to a joint commitment to believe that p as a body), there is group belief that p. Note that she provides necessary and sufficient conditions for the existence of a plural subject of belief. But Gilbert recognizes in later work (1994) that there may be cases in which we want to say that a group has a belief, yet they do not meet the existence conditions for a plural subject of belief. This recognition leads her to say that what she is giving is an analysis of the core notion of group belief and that other cases of group belief will be extensions of this core notion. Thus, we end up with the following statement of the conceptually sufficient conditions for group belief:

There is a group belief that p if some persons constitute the plural subject of a belief that p. Such persons collectively believe that p.

Unique to Gilbert's account is the assertion that under certain circumstances individuals form a plural subject and this subject is the legitimate subject of intentional state ascriptions. Recall that Bratman and Searle deny that there is a collective entity that is the appropriate subject of intentional state ascription. Her account, then, is less individualistic than Searle's and Bratman's.

Gilbert's account of collective intentionality has been criticized on the following grounds. First, Tollefsen (2002) has argued that Gilbert's analysis is circular. This can be seen if we consider what it means to commit to doing one's part to make it the case that the group believe as a body or act as a body. Gilbert claims that the notion of a group of individuals acting together to constitute a body is primitive and it guides the actions and thoughts of individuals in the group. It is this notion that tells them what their part is and what they are committed to doing. It is from this concept, for instance, that one knows that she must not say p, without prefacing her remarks appropriately, when she is acting as member of a group that believes not p. To do so would be to disrupt the unity within the group and break their semblance of being "one body."

But this notion seems to be just the notion of a plural subject. For a collection of individuals to believe as a body or act as a body is for them to act or believe as a subject, a subject constituted by a plurality of individuals. Indeed Gilbert says as much in the following passage:

I do, of course, posit a mechanism for the construction of social groups (plural subjects of belief or action). And this mechanism can only work if everyone involved has a grasp of a subtle conceptual scheme, the conceptual scheme of plural subjects. Given that all have this concept, then the basic means for bringing plural subject-hood into being is at their disposal. All that anyone has to do is to openly manifest his willingness to be part of a plural subject of some particular attribute (1989, 416)

Plural subjects are formed when each of a set of individual agents expresses willingness to constitute, with the others, the plural subject of a goal, belief, principle of action, or other such thing, in conditions of common knowledge. The conceptually necessary conditions for plural subjecthood, then, contain the notion of plural subjecthood. As a conceptual analysis of our core notion of group belief -the belief of a plural subject-Gilbert's analysis seems circular.

Gilbert (in correspondence) has responded to this charge by arguing that for her the concept of a plural subject is a technical notion. It is not, as Tollefsen suggests, simply the notion of a subject comprised of individuals but of a subject formed on the basis of joint commitments. So her analysis of plural subjecthood does not contain the technical notion of a plural subject and her analysis is not circular. The passage above, however, suggests that, at the very least, the formation of plural subjects presupposes that the participants have an understanding of the technical concept of plural subjecthood and an understanding of joint commitments. Since both notions are very technical, it seems psychologically implausible that everyday folk have even an implicit understanding of these concepts.

Tuomela (1992) charges Gilbert with circularity, as well. Gilbert argues that joint commitments are to be analyzed in terms of individuals expressing their willingness to be jointly committed with others. But this analysis leave the concept of joint commitment unanalyzed. Gilbert does, however, say a great deal more about the notion of joint commitment than this suggests. In particular, her most recent work (2003) provides a more detailed explanation of joint commitment. Expressions of willingness come in as conditions for the formation of a joint commitment, not part of an analysis of the notion of joint commitment. If Gilbert's analysis of joint commitment does not appeal to the notion of a joint commitment then it seems she has avoided Tuomela's objection.

Tuomela (1998) has also argued that Gilbert's account is somewhat limited. Her account of group intentionality is an account of what we mean when we say "We believe that p," where "we" is a small, unstructured group like a reading club, poetry discussion group, and committees with no formal decision method. She claims that she is giving an analysis of our core meaning of group belief. But the paradigm case of attribution of intentional states to groups seems to be those in which the subject is an organization like a corporation. This is particularly true when one reflects on our practice of praising and blaming the actions of corporations, states, governments, etc. Yet it is unclear how Gilbert's account extends to organizations. It seems obvious that not every member of the organization (take, for instance, IBM) would have to openly express their willingness to do his or her part in bringing it about that IBM believes that profits are lower this year than last as a body in order for it to be true that IBM believe that. Does the person on the assembly line have to express his willingness to be jointly committed in the way described? It seems that not even an implicit expression of willingness (a failure to speak up) would make sense of this. To the extent that Gilbert's account does not seem to extend to a range of other types of groups to which the intentional idiom extends, Tuomela argues that it remains inadequate.

There may be ways, however, of extending Gilbert's analysis to account for the beliefs of large organizations. Gilbert suggests that one might explain corporate beliefs, for instance, by claiming that the core notion of group belief applies to the board of directors and there is a convention in place that makes the board's beliefs the beliefs of the corporation. Gilbert has used the plural subject framework to provide an account of convention (1989).

d. Tuomela

Raimo Tuomela (1992, 1995) develops an account of collective belief, he calls the positional account of group beliefs. This account relies on the notions of rule-based social positions and tasks that are defined by the rules in force in a collective and emphasizes the role of positional beliefs. "Positional beliefs are views that a position-holder has qua a position-holder or has internalized and accepted as a basis of his performances of aforementioned kinds of social tasks" (1995, 312). Strictly speaking, positional beliefs are not beliefs at all but acceptances. His account of collective belief attempts to encompass not only the beliefs of small, organized, groups but organizations as well. Tuomela also provides an analysis of shared we-beliefs (called non-normative or merely factual group beliefs). Shared we-beliefs are not, according to Tuomela, proper group (collective) beliefs. Collective belief does not require that any particular member actually believe that p. Whereas in the case of a we-belief each member believes that p and it is common knowledge that each member believes that p. In this respect shared we-beliefs are, according to Tuomela, those characterized by the summative accounts. They are able to capture certain social phenomena but cannot explain collective belief in cases like corporations or groups where individuals do not themselves believe the proposition in question. For our purposes we will be focusing on Tuomela's account of group (collective) belief proper.

In Chapter Seven of The Importance of Us (1995) and Group Beliefs (1992) Synthese, 91: 285-318. Raimo Tuomela provides the following analysis of our concept of collective belief.

(BG) G believes that p in the social and normative circumstances C if and only if in C there are operative members A1......An in G with respective positions P1.......Pn such that
(1) The agents A1....Am when they are performing their social tasks in their positions P1....Pm and due to their exercising the relevant authority system in G, (intentionally) jointly accept p as the view of G, and because of this exercise of the authority system they ought to continue to accept or positionally believe that p.
(2) there is a mutual belief among the operative members to the effect that (1)
(3) because of (1) the full-fledged and adequately informed non-operative members of G tend to tacitly accept-or at least ought to accept--p as members of G.
(4) there is a mutual belief in G to the effect that (3)

This account relies heavily on a distinction between operative and non-operative members, acceptance and belief, and the notion of correct social and normative circumstances. I will consider each of these features in turn.

Operative members are those members who are responsible for the group belief having the content that it does. In the case of a corporation, the board of directors may be the operative members. Whereas those who work on the assembly line or in the credit department, for instance, are non-operative members. Which members are operative is determined by the rules and regulations of the corporation. Such rules and regulations are part of the social and normative circumstances referred to in Tuomela's analysis.

The relevant social and normative circumstances involve tasks and social roles and rules, either formal (resembling laws or statutes) or informal (based on informal group agreements). So, for instance, corporations have certain rules that define the roles and tasks of its members. The rules are formal in some cases and are to be found in the corporate handbook or charter. These rules often specify which members are operative and define the relation between operative members and non-operative members. In addition, they make clear the chain of authority and decision-making procedures. "Indeed, in the case of typical formal collectives (like corporations), certain position-holders are required by the constitutive rules of the collective to set goals and accepts views for the collective" (1998, 308).

According to Tuomela's analysis, then, one of the necessary conditions for our concept of group belief to apply is that operative members have certain intentional states. In this respect he shares something with Gilbert's view and individualism in general. It is a further question whether Tuomela's account can be viewed as intentionalistic and, if so, whether his analysis suffers from circularity. I consider this issue below. For now we can note that, for Tuomela, the intentional states of individuals must be embedded in the right social and normative circumstances. So group belief statements are not analyzed solely in terms of statements about individual intentional states on Tuomela's view. Tuomela therefore breaks from strong analytical individualism.

Tuomela's account also relies on the distinction between accepting a proposition and believing it. Tuomela stresses the difference between accepting and believing by noting that accepting is an action where certain beliefs are "non-actional" or experiential. Perceptual beliefs seem to be of this kind. The agent is in some way passive. He concludes based on this that at least experiential believing is different from accepting a proposition. As for non-perceptual beliefs, Tuomela goes on to argue that they are also different from accepting a proposition. Typically, when someone is said to believe that p, she does so if and only if she accepts p as true (given a certain disquotational account of truth). Tuomela points out, however, that this need not always be the case. Someone might accept a proposition but not believe it. "A person may, for instance, accept as true that he (or his body) is a probabilistically fluctuating bunch of hadrons and leptons without really believing it to be true in the experiential sense, let alone having that conviction. His acceptance would then be "cognitive" acceptance in the sense that he would be willing to operate on the assumption in question, to concretely act on it and to use it as a premise in his reasoning, and so on." (1995, 309)

As we have seen, traditional summative accounts that require all or some of the members believe that p were too strong. Tuomela attempts to avoid this problem by requiring that operative members accept that p. No member actually has to believe that p. The operative members have, in Tuomela's view, positional beliefs. Positional beliefs are views a position-holder has accepted as a basis for his performance of certain kinds of social tasks. These positional beliefs are different from personal beliefs. For instance, the board of directors might personally believe that it is wrong for the company to fire 10,000 employees yet a director accepts this proposition and acts on it given the fact that he holds a position of authority in the company. Positional views, then, need not be truth-related. We may accept false beliefs and therefore adopt positional views that we know to be false.

Tollefsen (2002) has argued that Tuomela's account suffers from the same problem of circularity from which Gilbert's account suffers. Consider condition (1) of Tuomela's analysis.

(1) The agents A1....Am when they are performing their social tasks in their positions P1....Pm, and due to their exercising the relevant authority system in G, (intentionally) jointly accept p as the view of G, and because of this exercise of the authority system they ought to continue to accept or positionally believe that p.

The operative members must intentionally and jointly accept P as the view of the group, where joint acceptance simply means that each operative member accepts p as the view of the group and this is common knowledge. But what are we to make of the reference to "the view of the group"? On an ordinary understanding of what it is to have a view on some issue is to have an opinion or a belief. The "view" of the group, then, seems to be simply the belief of the group. If so, one of the necessary and sufficient conditions for group belief appears to make reference to the notion of a group belief. Tuomela's analysis, then, is circular. There is a group belief that p if and only if operative members accept p as the group belief. But group belief (the view of the group rather than the view of its individual members) is the concept that the analysis is supposed to illuminate by providing necessary and sufficient conditions for its application. It is hard to see how to make sense of the view of the group without appealing to notions like the belief of the group, the goal of the group, what the group intends, and so on.

The circularity issues raised by Gilbert's and Tuomela's account might be avoided if we simply give up the methodology of conceptual analysis. Indeed, Tuomela insists that he is not engaged in conceptual analysis but is providing truth conditions for our ascriptions. Thus, although his account is circular, it is not viciously so. We can view these accounts, then, as offering us a sort of identity theory of collective intentionality. Indeed, this is how Bratman viewed his account of collective (shared) intention. Group belief and intention plays a certain role. What these theorists have done is identify a complex of interrelated intentional states of individuals that plays that role. One could, then, conclude that collective belief and/or intention is that complex of attitudes.

The problem with this approach is that one might wonder whether there might not be other ways in which these roles could be realized. Might there not be other combinations of individual attitudes and public acts and conditions, combinations that even in our world would function together in the ways that realize the roles of shared intention? The problem is analogous to type identity theories in the philosophy of mind. If mental states are multiply realized by different sorts of physical states, then type identity is false. Analogously, if collective intentional states are multiply realizable then identifying them with the complex of individual states is also problematic. Collective intentional states could plausibly be realized by a variety of different configurations of individual intentional states. Indeed, Tuomela's voluminous work on group intentionality supports this. He provides different accounts of group intentional states depending on the particular group in question (e.g. normative vs. normative group belief). And we have also seen that Gilbert acknowledges that the conditions she identifies for group intentional states are sufficient but not necessary. This leaves open the possibility that group beliefs and other attitudes could be realized by other sets of individual intentional states. At the most, then, these accounts provide us with accounts of ways in which group attitudes can be realized but they do not provide us with an account of what group attitudes are.

We are left with the same question that plagues token-token identity theories in the philosophy of mind. The token identity thesis states that for every token instance of a mental state, there will be some token neuro-physiological event with which that token instance is identical. But what is it about these token mental states that makes them all tokens of the same type? If Sue and Eric both believe that Columbus is the capital of Ohio, then what is it that they have in common that makes their different neurophysiological states the same belief?

We can formulate the same question with respect to group intentional states. If GM and the Federal Reserve are both ascribed the belief that interest rates should be cut, what do these two groups have in common that makes it appropriate to ascribe to them the same belief? Tuomela would point to the fact that they both meet the conditions he specifies for proper group belief. But what if the members of GM meet the conditions of normative group belief and the members of the Federal Reserve Board meet the conditions for non-normative group belief? Do they share the same belief? And we are left with the further question of what is it about these particular configurations of intentional states that makes it appropriate to call them beliefs or intentions at all? Why is collective intentionality a species of intentionality? The work of Pettit (2002), Tollefsen (2002c), and Velleman (1997) attempt to fill this lacuna by showing that certain groups count as intentional agents given standard accounts of intentionality. Rather than analyze the concept of collective intentions or beliefs, these theorists have attempted to show that our everyday concept of belief and intention extends naturally to certain groups. Gilbert (2002), also, has recently attempted to flesh out the strong analogy between individual beliefs and group beliefs.

4. Internal Debates: Belief vs. Acceptance

Among those who acknowledge that collectives can be the subject of intentional state ascription, there is a debate raging over which type of intentional states are appropriately attributable to collectives. There are some, like Margaret Gilbert and Tollefsen who argue that it is appropriate to attribute to groups a wide range of intentional states including beliefs. Others, like K. Brad Wray (2002), Raimo Tuomela (2000), and Anthonie Meijers (1999), have argued that, although groups may accept a proposition, they cannot believe. The nature of belief, according to these philosophers, is such that groups cannot be believers. The latter camp has been labeled by Gilbert as the rejectionists because they reject the possibility of group belief. For ease, I refer to the former camp as the believers.

In "Collective Belief and Acceptance" (2002), Wray identifies four differences between acceptance and belief.

  1. You can accept things that you do not believe but you cannot believe what you do not accept. (Rejection of the entailment thesis)
  2. "Acceptance often results from a consideration of one's goals, and thus results from adopting a policy to pursue a particular goal." (2002, p. 7).
  3. Belief is a disposition to feel that something is true.
  4. Belief is involuntary, whereas acceptance is voluntary.

Wray then proceeds to show that the examples that Gilbert gives of group belief (1989), (1994), are actually instances of acceptance. Because group attitudes are formed against the background of goals, because they are formed voluntarily, and because their formation does not entail that members believe the content of the attitude, group views are more aptly described as instances of acceptance. Both Wray (2000) and Meijers (1999) develop an acceptance-based account of collective attitudes.

There have been various attempts to respond to this line of argument. Much rests on the merits of the original distinction between acceptance and belief and on exploring the analogy between groups and individuals. Tollefsen (2003b), for instance, argues that the issue of voluntarism concerning belief is not as clear cut as rejectionists make it out to be. The assertion that we cannot will to believe is an empirical assertion and not a conceptual assertion about the nature of belief. Perhaps, then, individuals cannot will to believe because of our epistemic limits, but this does not rule out the possibility that collective agents can will to believe. Gilbert (2002) has argued that rejectionists beg the question with respect to collective belief. They assume that collective belief must have all the features of individual belief in order for it to be genuine belief but this just privileges individual belief without argument. It may be that collective belief, although a species of belief, is unique in certain respects.

5. The Role of Collective Intentionality

We have already seen that some theorists focus on the role of collective intentions in organizing and coordinating collective action. And in Searle's account of social reality, collective intentions confer status functions on artifacts and turn them into social facts. Money is money because we accept it and intend it to be. Others have explored the role that collective intentionality, either collective intentions or beliefs, plays in jurisprudence, economics, and politics, and moral theory. Gilbert (2001), for instance, argues that her account of collective intentionality provides a better account of social rules than H.L.A. Harts. Social rules are to be understood as the joint commitments of a society. This explains why we are justified in rebuking those who violate social rules. Maria Cristina Redondo (2001) argues that Searle's account of social facts, an account grounding in collective intentionality, supports a version of legal positivism. Ota Weinberger (2001) develops the relationship between discussions of collective intentionality and the notion of the "general will" or the "will of the people." Weinberger argues that the "general will" should be understood in terms of institutional processes that are collectively accepted within the community.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bratman, M. 1987. Intentions, Plans, and Practical Reason. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Bratman, M. 1992. "Practical Reasoning and Acceptance in a Context." Mind 101: 1-15.
  • Bratman, M. 1993. "Shared Intention." Ethics 104: 97-113.
  • Bratman, M. 1999. Faces of Intention. Cambridge, MA: Cambridge University Press.
  • Cohen, L.J. 1992. An Essay on Belief and Acceptance. Oxford, U.K.: Clarendon Press.
  • Corlett, A. 1996. Analyzing Social Knowledge. Maryland: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Davidson, D. 1992. The Second Person. Midwest Studies in Philosophy XVII: 255-265.
  • Gilbert, M. 1987. Modelling Collective Belief. Synthese, vol. 73. Reprinted in (1996). Chapter 7.
  • Gilbert, M. 1989. On Social Facts. New York: Routledge.
  • Gilbert, M. 1993. "Agreements, Coercion, and Obligation." Ethics. 103: 679-706
  • Gilbert, M. 1994. "Remarks on collective belief" in Frederick Schmitt ed. Socializing Epistemology. Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Gilbert, M. 1996. Living Together. Maryland: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Gilbert, M. 1996. "Concerning Sociality: The Plural Subject as Paradigm" in J. Greenwood (ed.), The Mark of the Social. Maryland: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Gilbert, M. (2000) Sociality and Responsibility. Blue Ridge Summit: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Gilbert, M. 2001. "Social Rules as Plural Subject Phenomena" in Lagerspetz et. al.
  • Gilbert, M. 2002. "Belief and Acceptance as Features of Groups." Protosociology, Volume 16, 35-69.
  • Gilbert, M. 2003. "The Structure of the Social Atom: Joint Commitment and the Foundation of Human Social Behavior" in Schmitt, F. ed. Socializing Metaphysics. Maryland: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Hindriks, F. 2002. "Social Groups, Collective Intentionality, and Anti-Hegelian Skepticism," in Realism in Action: Essays in the Philosophy of Social Science, Matti Sintonen, Petri Ylikoski, and Kaarlo Miller (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Hindricks, F.A. (2002) "Social Ontology, Collective Intentionality, and Ockhamian Skepticism" in Meggle (2002), 125-49.
  • Lagerspetz, E. Heikki Ikaheimo, and Jussi Kotkavirta, eds. 2001 On the Nature of Social and Institutional Reality. Finland, SoPhi.
  • Lewis, D. 1969. Convention: A Philosophical Study. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Meggle, G. (ed.) (2002) Social Facts and Collective Intentionality, Frankfurt am Main: Hansel-Hohenhausen.
  • Meijers, A. (1994). Speech Acts, Communication, and Collective Intentionality:Beyond Searle's Individualism. Leiden.
  • Meijers, A. (1999) Belief, Cognition, and the Will. Tilburg: Tilburg University Press, 59-71.
  • Meijers, A. (2003) "Can Collective Intentionality be Individualized?" American Journal of Economics and Sociology 62, 167-93.
  • Miller, S. 2001. Social Action, Cambridge University Press.
  • Pettit, P. (2003) "Groups with Minds of their Own" in Schmitt F. (ed) Socializing Metaphysics, Rowman and Littlefield, pp. 167-93.
  • Quinton, A. 1975. "Social Objects." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 75: 67-87.
  • Redondo, M. 2001. "On Normativity in Legal Contexts," in Lagerspetz et al.
  • Scanlon, T. 1998. What We Owe to Each Other. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Schmitt, F. (ed). 2003. Socializing Metaphysics. Maryland: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Searle, J. 1990. "Collective Intentions and Actions." In Intentions in Communication, P.Cohen, J. Morgan, and M.E. Pollack, eds. Cambridge, MA: Bradford Books, MIT press.
  • Searle, J. 1995. The Construction of Social Reality. New York, N.Y.: Free Press.
  • Stoutland, F. 1997. "Why Are Philosophers of Action so Anti-Social?" in Alanen, Heinamaa, and Wallgreen eds. Commonality and Particularity in Ethics. New York, N.Y.: St. Martin's Press.
  • Tollefsen, D. 2002. "Collective Intentionality and the Social Sciences." Philosophy of the Social Sciences 32 (1): 25-50.
  • Tollefsen, D. 2002b. "Challenging Epistemic Individualism." Protosociology, volume 16, pp. 86-117. June 2002.
  • Tollefsen, D. 2002c. "Organizations as True Believers." Journal of Social Philosophy, vol 33 (3): pp. 395-411.
  • Tollefsen, D. 2002d. Interpreting Organizations. Dissertation. Ohio State University.
  • Tollefsen, D. 2003a. "Collective Epistemic Agency." Southwest Philosophy Review, vol. 20 (1), pp. 55-66.v
  • Tollefsen, D. 2003b. "Rejecting Rejectionism." Protosociology, volume 18. pp. 389-408.
  • Tollefsen, D. 2004. "Joint Action and Joint Attention." Under review Philosophy of the Social Sciences
  • Tuomela, R. 1992. Group Beliefs. Synthese 91: 285-318.
  • Tuomela, R. 1993. "Corporate Intention and Corporate Action." Analyse und Kritik 15: 11-21.
  • Tuomela, R. 1995. The Importance of Us. Standford: Standford University Press.
  • Tuomela, R. 2000. Cooperation: A Philosophical Study. Philosophical Studies Series, Kluwer Academic Publishers, Dordrecht.
  • Tuomela, R. 2002. The Philosophy of Social Practices. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Tuomela, R. (2003). The Philosophy of Social Practices. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Tuomela, R. 2004. "We-Intention Revisted." forthcoming in Philosophical Studies.
  • Velleman, D. 1997. "How to Share an Intention." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LVII: 29-50.
  • Weinberger, O. 2001. "Democracy and theory of institutions," in Lagerspetz et al.
  • Wray, B. 2000. "Collective Belief and Acceptance." Synthese 00: 1-15.

Author Information

Deborah Tollefsen
University of Memphis
U. S. A.