Category Archives: Metaphysics & Epistemology

Aquinas: Metaphysics

aquinasMetaphysics is taken by Thomas Aquinas to be the study of being qua being, that is, a study of the most fundamental aspects of being that constitute a being and without which it could not be. Aquinas’s metaphysical thought follows a modified but general Aristotelian view. Primarily, for Aquinas, a thing cannot be unless it possesses an act of being, and the thing that possesses an act of being is thereby rendered an essence/existence composite. If an essence has an act of being, the act of being is limited by that essence whose act it is. The essence in itself is the definition of a thing; and the paradigm instances of essence/existence composites are material substances (though not all substances are material for Aquinas; for example, God is not). A material substance (say, a cat or a tree) is a composite of matter and form, and it is this composite of matter and form that is primarily said to exist. In other words, the matter/form composite is predicated neither of, nor in, anything else and is the primary referent of being; all other things are said of it. The details of this very rich metaphysical landscape are described below.

Table of Contents

  1. The Nature of Metaphysics
  2. Essence and Existence
  3. Participation
  4. Substance and Accident
  5. Matter and Form
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. General Studies

1. The Nature of Metaphysics

Saint Thomas, that is, Aquinas, clarifies the nature of metaphysics through ascertaining its particular subject-matter, its field of investigation. In order to ascertain the subject-matter of any particular science, Thomas distinguishes between the different intellectual operations that we use when engaged in some particular scientific endeavor. Broadly speaking, these fall into two categories: the speculative and the practical. Concerning some sciences, the intellect is merely speculative  by contemplating the truth of some particular subject-matter; while concerning other sciences, the intellect is practical, by  ascertaining the truth and seeking to apply. There are thus correspondingly two distinct classes of science: speculative science and practical science. Speculative sciences are those that contemplate truth whereas practical sciences are those that apply truth for some practical purpose. The sciences are then further distinguished through differentiating their various subject-matters.

Insofar as the speculative sciences merely contemplate truth but do not apply it for some practical purpose, the subject-matter of the speculative sciences is that which can be understood to some extent. Working within the Aristotelian tradition, Thomas holds that something is understood when it is separated from matter and is necessary to thing in some respect. For instance, when we understand the nature of a tree, what we understand is not primarily the matter that goes to constitute the tree in question, but what it is to be a tree, or the structuring principle of the matter that so organizes it and specifies it as a tree rather than a plant. Furthermore, assuming our understanding is correct, when we understand a thing to be a tree, we do not understand it to be a dog, or a horse, or a cat. Thus, in our understanding of a tree, we understand that which is necessary for the tree to be a tree, and not of anything that is not a tree. Hence, our understanding of a thing is separated from its matter and is necessary to it in some respect. Now, what is in motion is not necessary, since what is in motion can change. Thus, the degree to which we have understood something is conditional upon the degree to which it is separated from matter and motion. It follows then that speculative objects, the subject-matter of the speculative-sciences, insofar as they are what are understood, will be separated from matter and motion to some degree. Any distinctions that obtain amongst speculative objects will in turn signify distinctions amongst the sciences that consider those objects; and we can find distinctions amongst speculative objects based upon their disposition towards matter and motion.

There are three divisions that can apply to speculative objects, thereby permitting us to differentiate the sciences that consider such objects: (i) there is a class of speculative objects that are dependent on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood, for instance, human beings cannot be without matter, and they cannot be understood without their constituent matter (flesh and bones); (ii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion for their being, but not for their being understood, for instance, we can understand lines, numbers, and points without thereby understanding the matter in which they are found, yet such things cannot be without matter; (iii) there is a class of speculative objects that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood.

Given these three classes of speculative objects, the speculative sciences that consider them can be enumerated accordingly: (i) physical science considers those things that depend on matter and motion both for their being and for their being understood; (ii) mathematics considers those things that depend on matter and motion for their being but not for their being understood; (iii) metaphysics or theology deals with those things that depend on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Before going on to consider the subject-matter of metaphysics in a little more detail, it is important to point out that Thomas takes this division of the speculative sciences as exhaustive. For Thomas, there could be no fourth speculative science; the reason for this is that the subject-matter of such a science would have to be those things that depend on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being, for all other combinations have been exhausted. Now, if a thing depends on matter and motion for its being understood but not for its being, then matter and motion would be put into its definition, which defines a thing as it exists. But if a thing’s existence is so defined as to include matter and motion, then it follows that it depends on matter and motion for its being; for it cannot be understood to be without matter and motion. Hence, all things that include matter and motion in their definitions are dependent on matter and motion for their being, but not all things that depend on matter and motion for their being depend on matter and motion for their being understood. There could be no fourth speculative science since there is no fourth class of speculative objects depending on matter and motion for their being understood but not for their being. Thomas thus sees this threefold division of the speculative sciences as an exhaustive one.

The third class of speculative objects comprises the objects of metaphysics or theology. Now Thomas does not equate these two disciplines, but goes on to distinguish between the proper subject-matter of metaphysics and the proper subject-matter of theology. Recall that this third class of speculative objects comprises those things depending on matter and motion neither for their being nor for their being understood. Such things are thus immaterial things; however, Thomas here draws a distinction. There are things that are immaterial insofar as they are in themselves complete immaterial substances; God and the angels would be examples of such things. To give the latter a title, let them be called positively immaterial. On the other hand there are things that are immaterial insofar as they simply do not depend on matter and motion, but can nevertheless be sometimes said to be found therein. In other words, things of the latter category are neutral with respect to being found in matter and motion, and hence they are neutrally immaterial. St Thomas’s examples of the latter are: being, substance, potency, form, act, one and many; such things can apply equally to material things (such as humans, dogs, cats, mice) and, to some extent, to positively immaterial things. Thus, the neutrally immaterial seem to signify certain aspects or modes of being that can apply equally to material and to immaterial things. The question then arises: what is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics: the positively immaterial or the neutrally immaterial?

According to Thomas, unaided human reason cannot have direct knowledge of the positively immaterial; this is because such things (God and angels) outstrip the human intellect’s capacity to know. Nevertheless, direct knowledge of the positively immaterial is possible, but this will not be on the basis of unaided human reason; it will require that the positively immaterial reveal themselves to us in some way, in which case direct knowledge of the positively immaterial will be dependent on some sort of revelation. As it is a purely rational science, not dependent on or presupposing the truths of revelation, metaphysics will be a study of the neutrally immaterial aspects of things, that is, a study of those modes of being that apply to all beings, whether they are material or immaterial. Such a study will be in accord with the Aristotelian conception of metaphysics as a study of being qua being, insofar as the neutrally immaterial apply to all beings and are not restricted to a certain class of beings. However, Thomas does not adopt the Aristotelian phrase (being qua being) as the subject-matter of metaphysics, he offers his own term. According to Thomas, ens commune (common being) is the proper subject-matter of metaphysics. Through an investigation of ens commune, an investigation into the aspects of being common to all beings, the metaphysician may indeed come to a knowledge of the causes of being and might thereby be led to the affirmation of divine being, but this is only at the end of the metaphysical inquiry, not at the beginning. Thus, metaphysics for Aquinas is a study of ens commune where this is understood as the common aspects of being without which a thing could not be; it does not presuppose the existence of divine being, and may not even be led to an affirmation of divine being (though Thomas of course offers several highly complex metaphysical arguments for the existence of divine being, but this should not be taken to be essential to the starting point of Thomistic metaphysics).

Metaphysics then is a study of the certain aspects common to all beings; and it is the task of the metaphysician to uncover the aspects of being that are indeed common and without which a thing could not be. There are certain aspects of being that are common insofar as they are generally applicable to all beings, and these are essence and existence; all beings exist and have an essence, hence metaphysics will be primarily concerned with the nature of essence and existence and their relationship to each other. Having completed an investigation into essence and existence, the metaphysician must investigate the aspects of being that are common to particular instances of being; and this will be a study of (i) the composition of substance and accident, and (ii) the composition of matter and form. The format of Thomistic metaphysics then takes a somewhat dyadic structure of descending generality: (i) essence and existence, (ii) substance and accident, (iii) matter and form. The format of the remainder of this article will be an investigation into these dyadic structures.

2. Essence and Existence


A general notion of essence is the following: essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. Quite generally then, the essence of a thing is signified by its definition. The immediate question then is how the essence of a thing relates to its existence. In finite entities, essence is that which has existence, but it is not existence; this is a crude articulation of Thomas’s most fundamental metaphysical teaching: that essence and existence are distinct in finite entities. A consideration then of essence and existence in Thomas’s metaphysical thought will thus be a consideration of his fundamental teaching that essence and existence are distinct.

The most famous, and to a certain degree the most controversial, instance wherein Thomas argues for a distinction between a thing’s essence and its existence is in De Ente et Essentia [On Being and Essence] Chapter Four. The context is a discussion of immaterial substances and whether or not they are composed of matter. In that passage, Thomas is concerned with a popular medieval discussion known as universal hylemorphism. St Bonaventure, Thomas’s contemporary, had held that insofar as creatures are in potency in some respect, they must be material in some respect, since on the Aristotelian account, matter is the principle of potency in a thing. Thus, creatures, even immaterial creatures, must be material in some respect, even if this materiality is nothing like our corporeal materiality. Thomas takes up this issue in De Ente Chapter 4, pointing out that the Jewish thinker Avicebron seems to have been the author of this position.

Thomas takes the notion of universal hylemorphism to be absurd. Not only does it conflict with the common sayings of the philosophers, but also it is precisely as separated from matter and all material conditions that we deem separate (immaterial) substances separate, in which case they cannot be composed of matter. But if such substances cannot be composed of matter, what accounts for their potentiality? Such substances are not God, they are not pure act, they are in potentiality in some respect. So, if they are not material, then how are they in potency? Thomas is thus led to hold that they have an element of potentiality, but this is not the potency supplied by matter; rather, immaterial substances are composed of essence and existence, and it is the essence of the thing, standing in potency to a distinct act of existence, that accounts for the potentiality of creatures and thereby distinguishes them from God, who is not so composed. Thomas’s argumentation for the distinction between essence and existence unfolds on three stages and for each stage there has been at least one commentator who has held that Thomas both intended and established the real distinction therein.

In the first stage Thomas argues as follows. Whatever does not enter into the understanding of any essence is composed with that essence from without; for we cannot understand an essence without understanding the parts of that essence. But we can understand the essence of something without knowing anything about its existence; for instance, one can understand the essence of a man or a phoenix without thereby understanding the existence of either. Hence, essence and existence are distinct.

This little paragraph has generated considerable controversy, insofar as it is unclear what sort of distinction Thomas intends to establish at this stage. Is it merely a logical distinction whereby it is one thing to understand the essence of a thing and another to understand its existence? On this account, essence and existence could well be identical in the thing yet distinct in our understanding thereof (just as ‘Morning star’ and ‘Evening star’ are distinct in our conceptual expressions of the planet Venus, yet both are identical with Venus). On the other hand, does Thomas attempt to establish a real distinction whereby essence and existence are not only distinct in our understanding, but also in the thing itself? Commentators who hold that this stage only establishes a logical distinction focus on the fact that Thomas is here concerned only with our understanding of essence and not with actual (real) things; such commentators include Joseph Owens and John Wippel. Commentators who hold that this stage establishes a real distinction focus on the distinction between the act of understanding a thing’s essence and the act of knowing its existence, and they argue that a distinction in cognitional acts points to a distinction in reality; such commentators include Walter Patt, Anthony Kenny, and Steven Long.

In the second stage of argumentation, Thomas claims that if there were a being whose essence is its existence, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence would differ. This is clear when we consider how things can be multiplied. A thing can be multiplied in one of three ways: (i) as a genus is multiplied into its species through the addition of some difference, for instance the genus ‘animal’ is multiplied into the species ‘human’ through the addition of ‘rational’; (ii) as a species is multiplied into its individuals through being composed with matter, for instance the species ‘human’ is multiplied into various humans through being received in diverse clumps of matter; (iii) as a thing is absolute and shared in by many particular things, for instance if there were some absolute fire from which all other fires were derived. Thomas claims that a being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied in either of the first two ways (he does not consider the third way, presumably because in that case the thing that is received or participated in is not itself multiplied; the individuals are multiplied and they simply share in some single absolute reality). A being whose essence is its existence could not be multiplied (i) through the addition of some difference, for then its essence would not be its existence but its existence plus some difference, nor could it be multiplied (ii) through being received in matter, for then it would not be subsistent, but it must be subsistent if it exists in virtue of what it is. Overall then, if there were a being whose essence is its existence, it would be unique, there could only be one such being, in all else essence and existence are distinct.

Notice that Thomas has once again concluded that essence and existence are distinct. John Wippel takes this to be the decisive stage in establishing that essence and existence are really distinct. He argues that insofar as it is impossible for there to be more than one being whose essence is its existence, there could not be in reality many such beings, in which case if we grant that there are multiple beings in reality, such beings are composed of essence and existence. On the other hand, Joseph Owens has charged Wippel with an ontological move and claims that Wippel is arguing from some positive conceptual content, to the actuality of that content in reality. Owens argues that we cannot establish the real distinction until we have established that there is something whose essence is its existence. Given the existence of a being whose essence is its existence, we can contrast its existence with the existence of finite things, and conclude that the latter are composites of essence and existence; and so Owens sees the real distinction as established at stage three of Thomas’s argumentation: the proof that there actually is a being whose essence is its existence.

Thomas begins stage three with the premise that whatever belongs to a thing belongs to it either through its intrinsic principles,  its essence, or from some extrinsic principle. A thing cannot be the cause of its own existence, for then it would have to precede itself in existence, which is absurd. Everything then whose essence is distinct from its existence must be caused to be by another. Now, what is caused to be by another is led back to what exists in itself (per se). There must be a cause then for the existence of things, and this because it is pure existence (esse tantum); otherwise an infinite regress of causes would ensue.

It is here that Owens believes that Thomas establishes the real distinction; since Thomas establishes (to his own satisfaction) that there exists a being whose essence is its existence. Consequently, we can contrast the existence of such a being with the existence of finite entities and observe that in the latter existence is received as from an efficient cause whereas in the former it is not. Thus, essence and existence are really distinct. However, it is important to note that on this interpretation, the real distinction could not enter into the argument for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence; for, on Owens’s account, such argumentation is taken to establish the real distinction. If it can be shown then that Thomas’s argumentation for the existence of a being whose essence is its existence does presuppose the real distinction, then Owens’s views as to the stage at which the real distinction is established would be considerably undermined.

Having established (at some stage) that essence and existence are distinct and that there exists a being whose essence is its existence, Thomas goes on to conclude that in immaterial substances, essence is related to existence as potency to act. The latter follows insofar as what receives existence stands in potency to the existence that it receives. But all things receive existence from the being whose essence is its existence, in which case the existence that any one finite thing possesses is an act of existence that actuates a corresponding potency: the essence. Thomas has thus shown that immaterial substances do indeed have an element of potency, but this need not be a material potency.

Notice that here Thomas correlates essence and existence as potency and act only after he has concluded to the existence of a being whose essence is its existence (God). One wonders then whether or not essence and existence can be related as potency and act only on the presupposition of the existence of God. Regardless of his preferred method in the De Ente Chapter 4, Thomas could very well have focussed on the efficiently caused character of existence in finite entities (as he does in the opening lines of the argument for the existence of God), and argued that insofar as existence is efficiently caused (whether or not this is from God), existence stands to that in which it inheres as act to potency, in which case the essence that possesses existence stands in potency to that act of existence. Therefore, Thomas need not presuppose the existence of God in order to hold that essence and existence are related as potency and act; all he need presuppose is (i) that essence and existence are distinct and (ii) that existence is efficiently caused in the essence/existence composite.

3. Participation


Essence/existence composites merely have existence; whatever an essence/existence composite is, it is not its existence. Insofar as essence/existence composites merely have, but are not, existence, they participate in existence in order to exist. This is a second of Thomas’s fundamental metaphysical teachings: whatever does not essentially exist, merely participates in existence. Insofar as no essence/existence composite essentially exists, all essence/existence composites merely participate in existence. More specifically, the act of existence that each and every essence/existence composite possesses is participated in by the essence that exists.

As a definition of participation, Thomas claims that to participate is to take a part (in) (partem capere) something. Following this definition, Thomas goes on to explain how one thing can be said to take a part in and thereby participate in another; this can happen in three ways.

Firstly, when something receives in a particular fashion what pertains universally to another, it is said to participate in that other; for example, a species (‘man’) is said to participate in its genus (‘animal’) and an individual (Socrates) is said to participate in its species (‘man’) because they (the species and the individual) do not possess the intelligible structure of that in which they participate according to its full universality.

Secondly, a subject is said to participate in the accidents that it has (for instance, a man is a certain colour, and thereby participates in the colour of which he is), and matter is said to participate in the formal structure that it has (for instance, the matter of a statue participates in the shape of that statue in order to be the statue in question).

Thirdly, an effect can be said to participate in its cause, especially when the effect is not equal to the power of that cause. The effect particularises and determines the scope of the cause; for the effect acts as the determinate recipient of the power of the cause. The effect receives from its cause only that which is necessary for the production of the effect. It is in this way that a cause is participated in by its effect.

In all of the foregoing modes of participation, to participate is to limit that which is participated in some respect. This follows from the original etymological definition of participation, that to participate is to take a part (in); for if to participate is merely to take a part in something, the participant will not possess the nature of the thing in which it participates in any total fashion, but only in partial fashion. What then can we conclude about the participation framework that governs essence and existence?

Essences exist, but they do not exist essentially, they participate in their acts of existence. Insofar as an essence participates in its act of existence, the essence limits that act of existence to the nature of the essence whose act it is; for the essence merely has existence, it is not existence, in which case its possession of existence will be in accord with the nature of the essence. The act of existence is thus limited and thereby individuated to the essence whose act it is. As a concrete application of this, consider the following. George Bush’s existence is not Tony Blair’s existence; when George Bush came into existence, Tony Blair did not come into existence, and when George Bush ceases to exist, Tony Blair will, in all likelihood, not cease to exist. George Bush’s existence is not indexed to the existence of Tony Blair, in which case the existence of either George Bush or Tony Blair is not identical to the other. The act of existence then is individuated to the essence whose act it is, and this because the essence merely participates in, and thereby limits, the act of existence that it possesses.

4. Substance and Accident


The next fundamental metaphysical category is that of substance. According to Aquinas, substances are what are primarily said to exist, and so substances are what have existence but yet are not identical with existence. Aquinas’s ontology then is comprised primarily of substances, and all change is either a change of one substance into another substance, or a modification of an already existing substance. Given that essence is that which is said to possess existence, but is not identical to existence, substances are essence/existence composites; their existence is not guaranteed by what they are. They simply have existence as limited by their essence.

Let us begin with a logical definition of substance, as this will give us an indication of its metaphysical nature. Logically speaking, a substance is what is predicated neither of nor in anything else. This captures the fundamental notion that substances are basic, and everything else is predicated either of or in them. Now, if we transpose this logical definition of substance to the realm of metaphysics, where existence is taken into consideration, we can say that a substance is that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject or as a part of anything else, but what exists in itself. Thus, a substance is a properly basic entity, existing per se (though of course depending on an external cause for its existence), and the paradigm instances of which are the medium sized objects that we see around us: horses, cats, trees and humans.

On the other hand there are accidents. Accidents are what accrue to substances and modify substances in some way. Logically speaking, accidents are predicated of or in some substance; metaphysically speaking, accidents cannot exist in themselves but only as part of some substance. As their name suggests, accidents are incidental to the thing, and they can come and go without the thing losing its identity; whereas a thing cannot cease to be the substance that it is without losing its identity.

Accidents only exist as part of some substance. It follows then that we cannot have un-exemplified properties as if they were substances in themselves. Properties are always exemplified by some substance, whereas substance itself is un-exemplifiable. For example, brown is always predicated of something, we say that x is brown, in which case brown is an accident. However, brown is never found to be in itself, it is always exemplified by something of which it is said.

Within Aquinas’s metaphysical framework, substances can be both material (cats, dogs, humans) and immaterial (angels), but as noted above, the paradigm instances of substances are material substances, and the latter are composites of matter and form; a material substance is neither its matter alone nor its form alone, since matter and form are always said to be of some individual and never in themselves. It follows then that material substances have parts, and the immediate question arises as to whether or not the parts of substances are themselves substances. In order to address this issue, we must ask two questions: (i) while they are parts of a substance, are such parts themselves substances? and (ii) are the parts of a substance themselves things that can exist without the substance of which they are parts?

Concerning (i) we must say that whilst they are parts of a substance such parts cannot be substances; this is so given the definition of substance outlined above: that whose nature it is to exist not in some subject. Given that the parts of a substance are in fact parts of a substance, it is their nature to exist in some subject  of which they are a part. Consequently, the parts of a substance cannot themselves be substances.

Concerning (ii) the case is somewhat different, now we must consider whether or not the parts of a substance can exist without the substance of which they are parts, that is, after the dissolution of the substance of which they are parts do the parts become substances in themselves? The parts of a substance receive their identity through being the parts of the substance whose parts they are. Thus, the flesh and bone of a human are flesh and bone precisely because they are parts of a human. When the human dies, the flesh and bone are no longer flesh and bone (except equivocally speaking) because they are no longer parts of a human substance; rather, the flesh and bone cease to function as flesh and bone and begin to decompose, in which case they are not themselves substances. However, on Aquinas’s view, the elements out of which a substance is made can indeed subsist beyond the dissolution of the substance. Thus, whilst the elements are parts of the substance, they are not, as parts of a substance, substances in themselves, but when the substance dissolves, the elements will remain as independent substances in their own right. Thus, in the case of the dissolution of the human being, whilst the flesh and bone no longer remain but decompose, the elements that played a role in the formation of the substance remain. In more contemporary terms we could say that before they go to make up the bodily substances we see in the world, atoms are substances in themselves, but when united in a certain form they go to make cats, dogs, humans, and cease to be independent substances in themselves. When the cat or dog or human perishes, its flesh and bones perish with it, but its atoms regain their substantial nature and they remain as substances in themselves. So, a substance can have its parts, and for as long as those parts are parts of a substance, those parts are not substances in themselves, but when the substance decomposes, those parts can be considered as substances in themselves so long as they are capable of subsisting in themselves.

5. Matter and Form


A very crude definition of matter would be that it is the ‘stuff’ out of which a thing is made, whereas form is signified by the organisation that the matter takes. A common example used by Aquinas and his contemporaries for explaining matter and form was that of a statue. Consider a marble statue. The marble is the matter of the statue whereas the shape signifies the form of the statue. The marble is the ‘stuff’ out of which the statue is made whereas the shape signifies the form that the artist decided to give to the statue. On a more metaphysical level, form is the principle whereby the matter has the particular structure that it has, and matter is simply that which stands to be structured in a certain way. It follows from this initial account that matter is a principle of potency in a thing; since if the matter is that which stands to be structured in a certain way, matter can be potentially an indefinite number of forms. Form on the other hand is not potentially one thing or another; form as form is the kind of thing that it is and no other.

On Aquinas’s account, there are certain levels of matter/form composition. On one level we can think of the matter of a statue as being the marble whereas we can think of the shape of the statue as signifying the form. But on a different level with can think of the marble as signifying the form and something more fundamental being the matter. For instance, before the marble was formed into the statue by the sculptor, it was a block of marble, already with a certain form that made it ‘marble’. At this level, the marble cannot be the matter of the thing, since its being marble and not, say, granite, is its form. Thus, there is a more fundamental level of materiality that admits of being formed in such a way that the end product is marble or granite, and at a higher level, this formed matter stands as matter for the artist when constructing the statue.

If we think of matter as without any form, we come to the notion of prime matter, and this is a type of matter that is totally unformed, pure materiality itself. Prime matter is the ultimate subject of form, and in itself indefinable; we can only understand prime matter through thinking of matter as wholly devoid of form. As wholly devoid of form prime matter is neither a substance nor any of the other categories of being; prime matter, as pure potency, cannot in fact express any concrete mode of being, since as pure potency is does not exist except as potency. Thus, prime matter is not a thing actually existing, since it has no principle of act rendering it actually existing.

Matter can be considered in two senses: (i) as designated and (ii) as undesignated. Designated matter is the type of matter to which one can point and of which one can make use. It is the matter that we see around us. Undesignated matter is a type of matter that we simply consider through the use of our reason; it is the abstracted notion of matter. For instance, the actual flesh and bones that make up an individual man are instances of designated matter, whereas the notions of ‘flesh’ and ‘bones’ are abstracted notions of certain types of matter and these are taken to enter into the definition of ‘man’ as such. Designated matter is what individuates some form. As noted, the form of a thing is the principle of its material organisation. A thing’s form then can apply to many different things insofar as those things are all organised in the same way. The form then can be said to be universal, since it remains the same but is predicated over different things. As signifying the actual matter that is organised in the thing, designated matter individuates the form to ‘this’ or ‘that’ particular thing, thereby ensuring individuals (Socrates, Plato, Aristotle) of the same form (man).

Given that form is the principle of organisation of a thing’s matter, or the thing’s intelligible nature, form can be of two kinds. On the one hand, form can be substantial, organising the matter into the kind of thing that the substance is. On the other hand, form can be accidental, organising some part of an already constituted substance. We can come to a greater understanding of substantial and accidental form if we consider their relation to matter. Substantial form always informs prime matter and in doing so it brings a new substance into existence; accidental form simply informs an already existing substance (an already existing composite of substantial form and prime matter), and in doing so it simply modifies some substance. Given that substantial form always informs prime matter, there can be only one substantial form of a thing; for if substantial form informs prime matter, any other form that may accrue to a thing is posterior to it and simply informs an already constituted substance, which is the role of accidental form. Thus, there can only be one substantial form of a thing.

As stated above, essence is signified by the definition of a thing; essence is the definable nature of the thing that exists. A thing’s essence then is its definition. It follows that on Thomas’s account the essence of a thing is the composition of its matter and form, where matter here is taken as undesignated matter. Contrary to contemporary theories of essence, Aquinas does not, strictly speaking, take essence to be what is essential to the thing in question, where the latter is determined by a thing’s possessing some property or set of properties in all possible worlds. In the latter context, the essence of a thing comprises its essential properties, properties that are true of it in all possible worlds; but this is surely not Aquinas’s view. For Aquinas, the essence of a thing is not the conglomeration of those properties that it would possess in all possible worlds, but the composition of matter and form. On a possible-worlds view of essence, the essence of a thing could not signify the matter/form composite as it is in this actual world, since such a composite could be different in some possible world and therefore not uniform across all possible worlds. Thus, Aquinas does not adopt a possible-worlds view of essence; he envisages the essence of a thing as the definition or quiddity of the thing existing in this world, not as it would exist in all possible worlds.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • St Thomas Aquinas, Summa Theologiae, trans. Fathers of the English Dominican Province (1948), U.S.A: Christian Classics.
    • Aquinas’s philosophical and theological masterpiece; Part I (Prima Pars) is the most important for Thomas’s metaphysical thought.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, The Divisions and Methods of the Sciences: Questions V and VI of his Commentary on the De Trinitate of Boethius, trans. Armand Maurer (1953) Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
    • A detailed consideration by Thomas of the divisions and methods of the sciences.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, On Being and Essence, trans. Armand Maurer (1968), Toronto: Pontifical Institute Medieval Studies.
    • An excellent summary from Aquinas himself of his metaphysical views.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Summa Contra Gentiles, trans. A.C Pegis (1975), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • One of Aquinas’s great Summae; books I and II are most important for Thomas’s metaphysical thought.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, trans. John P. Rowan (1995), U.S.A: Dumb Ox Books.
    • A direct commentary on the Metaphysics of Aristotle.
  • St Thomas Aquinas, Aquinas on matter and form and the elements: a translation and interpretation of the De principiis naturae and the De mixtione elementorum of St. Thomas Aquinas, trans. Joseph Bobik (1998), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
    • A translation of and commentary on Aqiunas’s works on ‘matter and form and the elements’.

b. General Studies

  • Clarke, W.N., Explorations in Metaphysics — Being, God, Person (1994), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Clarke, W.N., The One and the Many — A Contemporary Thomistic Metaphysics (2001), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Copleston, F., Aquinas (1955), London: Penguin.
  • Davies, B., The Thought of Thomas Aquinas (1993), Oxford: Clarendon Paperbacks.
  • Fabro, C., La Nozione Metafisica di Partecipazione secondo S. Tommaso d’Aquino (1950), Turin: Società Editrice Internazionale.
  • Fabro, C., Participation et causalité selon S. Thomas d’Aquin (1961), Louvain: Publications Universaitaires.
    • Both works by Fabro were groundbreaking for their uncovering the Platonic influences in Aquinas’s thought.
  • de Finance, J., Être et agir dans la philosophie de Saint Thomas (1960), Rome: Librairie Éditrice de l’Université Grégorienne.
  • Geiger, L-B., La participation dans la philosophie de s. Thomas d’Aquin (1953), Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin.
    • As with Fabro’s work, Geiger’s too uncovers the Platonic influences in Aquinas’s thought.
  • Kenny, A., Aquinas on Being (2003), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Klima, G., ‘Contemporary “Essentialism” vs. Aristotelian Essentialism’, in John Haldane, ed., Mind Metaphysics, and Value in the Thomistic and Analytical Traditions (2002), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Kretzman, N., & Stump, E. eds. The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas (1993), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Long, S., ‘On the Natural Knowledge of the Real Distinction’, Nova et Vetera (2003), 1:1.
  • Long, S., ‘Aquinas on Being and Logicism’, New Blackfriars (2005), 86.
  • Owens, J., ‘A Note on the Approach to Thomistic Metaphysics’, The New Scholasticism (1954), 28:4.
  • Owens, J., ‘Quiddity and the Real Distinction in St Thomas Aquinas’, Mediaeval Studies (1965), 27.
  • Owens, J., The Doctrine of Being in the Aristotelian Metaphysics (1978), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
  • Owens, J., St Thomas Aquinas on the Existence of God — The Collected Papers of Joseph Owens ed. Catan, John. R. (1980), Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Owens, J., ‘Stages and Distinction in De Ente’, The Thomist, (1981), 45.
  • Owens, J., An Elementary Christian Metaphysics (1985), Houston, Texas: Bruce Publishing Company.
  • Owens, J., An Interpretation of Existence (1985), Texas: Center for Thomistic Studies — University of St Thomas.
  • Owens, J., ‘Aquinas’s Distinction at De Ente et Essentia 4.119 — 123’, Mediaeval Studies (1986), 48.
  • Patt, W. ‘Aquinas’s Real Distinction and some Interpretations’, The New Scholasticism (1988), 62:1.
  • Stump, E., Aquinas (2003), London-New York: Routledge.
    • Part I, Chapter I, offers a very good survey of Aquinas’s metaphysics, but leaves out details of his theory of essence/existence composition. Pp. 36 – 44 are particularly illuminating on matter and form, substance and accident.
  • Torrell, J.-P., Saint Thomas Aquinas: The Person and His Work, trans. Robert Royal (1996), Washington: The Catholic University of America Press.
    • This is the most up-to-date publication on Aquinas’s life and work.
  • te Velde R. A., Participation and Substantiality in Thomas Aquinas (1995), Leiden-New York-Cologne: E.J. Brill.
  • Wippel, J., 1979: ‘Aquinas’s Route to the Real Distinction’, The Thomist, 43.
  • Wippel, J.,  Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas (1984), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wippel, J.,  The Metaphysical Thought of Thomas Aquinas (2000), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Wippel, J.,  Metaphysical Themes in Thomas Aquinas II (2007), USA: The Catholic University of America Press.
    • Wippel’s work is generally taken to be essential for scholarly work on Aquinas’s metaphysical thought.


Author Information

Gaven Kerr
Queen's University Belfast
Northern Ireland

Epistemic Entitlement

In the early 1990s there emerged a growing interest with the concept of epistemic entitlement. Philosophers who acknowledge the existence of entitlements maintain that there are beliefs or judgments unsupported by evidence available to the subject, but which the subject nonetheless has the epistemic right to hold. Some of these may include beliefs non-inferentially sourced in perception, memory, introspection, testimony, and the a priori.  Unlike the traditional notion of justification, entitlement is often characterized as an externalist type of epistemic warrant, in the sense that a subject’s being entitled is determined by facts and circumstances that are independent of any reasoning capacities she may or may not have, and which the subject herself need not understand or be able to recognize. One key motivation for this view is that the inclusion of entitlement in epistemology can account for the commonly held intuition that largely unreflective individuals, such as children and non-human animals, possess warrant and basic knowledge about the world.  It also paves the way for a tenable foundationalist epistemology, according to which there exist warranted beliefs which are not themselves warranted or justified by any further beliefs.  This article explores theories of entitlement as presented by four prominent philosophers: Fred Dretske, Tyler Burge, Crispin Wright, and Christopher Peacocke.

Table of Contents

  1. Dretske on Entitlement
  2. Burge on Entitlement
  3. Wright on Entitlement
  4. Peacocke on Entitlement
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Dretske on Entitlement

Fred Dretske has argued for the existence of epistemic entitlements.  Like justification, entitlement is an epistemic property of belief which, when the belief is true (and the subject is not in a Gettier-style situation), constitutes knowledge.  Much of Dretske’s work on this topic rises out of his (2000) article: “Entitlements: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?”  Part of understanding his view involves having a grasp of the question being posed in the article’s title.  Unlike justifications, entitlements are epistemic rights we have to believe various propositions without having any added requirements to engage, or be able to engage, in some sophisticated mental exercise.  Considering what is included in the conception of justification, the traditional answer suggests that being justified is a matter of fulfilling various epistemic duties or obligations.  Some of these duties may include: gathering ample evidence, arriving at beliefs carefully and methodically, deliberating over the strength of one’s supportive reasons, and so forth.  For instance, if it is true that Detective Johnson is justified in believing

GUILTY: Smith is guilty of the murder,

then it must be that she has good reasons for thinking GUILTY true, reasons of which she herself is aware and could appeal to if she needed to defend her belief.  Johnson's reasons may be, for example, that Smith’s fingerprints were on the murder weapon and Smith had strong motive to kill.  Though these sorts of epistemic requirements obtain for beliefs like GUILTY (as we shall assume), Dretske thinks there are other sorts of beliefs you and I have which: (1) amount to genuine knowledge, but that also (2) are not justified in the sense just described.  Consider your perceptual belief that

BRIGHT: There is a bright screen ahead of me,

or a memorial belief that

ATE: I ate breakfast this morning.

Given that you know these propositions, it seems too strong a condition that you must recognize that which provides the epistemic support for these beliefs, or be in a position to defend them by way of some argument.  Additionally, many philosophers think that children and lower animals have perceptual and memorial knowledge, yet they lack the conceptual skills needed to be able to think about what it is that gives them this knowledge.  The point is that the conditions for acquiring a justification for a belief like GUILTY are harder to satisfy than they are for acquiring an entitlement for a belief like BRIGHT.  Thus, Dretske holds that there exists a kind of epistemic good that attaches to our various perceptual beliefs and memorial beliefs (and perhaps others) but which is distinct from the traditional notion of justification.  This epistemic good is what he calls entitlement.  To have an entitlement is to have the epistemic right to believe a proposition in which the possessor need not be consciously reflective of that which awards the entitlement.  (Notice that the relevant kinds of beliefs Dretske has in mind, like BRIGHT or ATE, are about things in the outer world, not our own conscious experiences or memories.)

In this way epistemic entitlements are analogous to various legal or constitutional rights we have.  There is no added physical effort or labor you had to exert to be awarded the right to vote in the U.S. presidential election; you have this right solely in virtue of having the status of being a U.S. citizen and at least eighteen years old.  Indeed, you have this right whether or not you know that you do.  The same goes for one’s right to the property bequeathed by a passing family member.  The recipient did not have to do anything to “earn” her entitlement to that property; that she is simply listed in the will suffices.  Similarly, what gives people the epistemic right, or entitlement, to hold various beliefs is determined by circumstances independent of any reasoning capacities they may or may not have.  A subject may have an entitlement to her belief even if she is unaware that she has it.

Before proceeding, note that Dretske is operating with a narrow characterization of justification.  He thinks that justification is an epistemically internalist notion in the sense that to be justified in holding a belief, there must be some proposition (or propositions) one already believes and which one has reflective access to and could be used to justify that belief.  On the other hand, entitlement receives an externalist characterization in the sense that one can have an entitlement without having access to that which makes one entitled.  It is worth mentioning, however, that not all epistemologists understand justification in the way Dretske does.  Whereas for Dretske, the things that do the justifying are other beliefs one has, some internalists allow other sorts of mental states, like perceptual experiences and memories, to count as reasons or justifications (Audi 1993 and Pryor 2000).  Also, some philosophers prefer to use ‘internalism’ simply as the claim that the things that justify a belief are internal to one’s mental life.  One could be an internalist about justification in this weaker sense, which is commonly referred to as mentalism (see Conee and Feldman 2003), without requiring that one be able to access or become aware of one’s justifying mental states or to believe that these states are reliable.  Thus, according to a mentalist, a child may be justified in believing BRIGHT, provided that it is properly grounded in her experience of a bright screen ahead, even if the child does not herself recognize her experience as that which makes her justified.  The point is that Dretskean entitlement, if it is a distinctive epistemic concept, differs from justification only as understood in Dretske’s restricted sense of the term as that of being backed by other beliefs to which one could appeal in support of one’s belief.

The main question Dretske wishes to answer is: if there are things we are entitled to accept as true, what grounds this entitlement?  In other words, what entitles us to believe various propositions?  It is important to emphasize that these are questions posed specifically to philosophers; entitled subjects themselves need not know, and quite often do not know, the answer to them.  Dretske begins his answer by distancing his view of entitlement from a pure reliabilist view that one has the epistemic right to the belief that p if and only if the belief that p was produced by a reliable process.  For a pure reliabilist, given that your perceptual system produced your belief that BRIGHT, and assuming that perception yields true beliefs on most occasions, you are epistemically permitted to hold this belief.  But according to Dretske, there are (at least) two reasons why entitlement must not be associated with this form of reliabilism.  First, one can surely hold what is in fact a reliably-produced belief while at the same time having independent reasons for doubting its truth (for example, you have evidence that you’ve taken a mind-altering drug, yet you continue to trust your senses as they indicate a three-foot bumble bee).  To maintain the belief in such a situation would, intuitively, be irrational on the subject’s part, which, it seems, would thereby strip the subject of her epistemic right to that belief.  However, by concentrating entirely on the reliability of a belief-forming process, a pure reliabilist cannot accommodate this intuition.  Entitlement must therefore be understood as a defeasible epistemic right, one that can be defeated by countervailing evidence.  Secondly, Dretske holds that entitlements supervene on the subjective resources of the subject.  This implies that two subjects with identical psychological make-ups cannot differ with respect to the entitlements they possess (For this reason, it is plausible that Dretskean entitlement has an element of internalism, but only of the weaker, mentalist sort described above).  For example, suppose there is some being who has the exact same experiences, beliefs, methods of reasoning, and so forth, as you do.  Suppose further that this “mental twin” of yours is, unbeknownst to her, nothing but a bodiless brain in a vat whose experiences are systematically being fed by a powerful supercomputer.  While your perceptual system is highly reliable (as we shall assume), your twin’s system is massively unreliable, because all of her experiences and corresponding beliefs are erroneous.  According to a pure reliabilist, then, whereas you have the epistemic right to believe BRIGHT when you have an experience of a bright screen before you, your envatted twin lacks the right to BRIGHT when she has the exact same experience.  Dretske, however, thinks that this is the wrong result. (The sort of case described here is commonly referred to as the New Evil Demon Problem, first introduced by Lehrer & Cohen 1983.)  He thinks it is intuitively correct that your twin has the right to believe whatever you have a right to believe, even if your beliefs are true and her’s false.  You have knowledge and your twin lacks it because knowledge requires truth and your twin’s beliefs are false; however, it seems that the unfortunate twin still retains some epistemic good.  The correct account of entitlement should allow for this intuition and therefore be suited to award entitlements to subjects who are in unfavorable, illusory environments. (Although the New Evil Demon Problem does pose a challenge to the pure version of reliabilism Dretske considers, it bears mentioning that several philosophers have advanced other versions of reliabilism which purport to avoid this problem.  See, for instance, Bach 1985, Goldman 1988, Comesaña 2002, Majors and Sawyer 2005.)

If the concept of entitlement is not grounded in the reliability of a belief-forming process, what is it grounded in?  Dretske argues that we have entitlements to beliefs which are psychologically immediate and irresistible to us.  There are certain sorts of beliefs over which we have no choice whether we hold them or not.  Perceptual beliefs are a prime example.  As you gaze your eyes on a computer screen, your visual experience of a bright screen causes you to believe BRIGHT.  The causal sequence between experience and belief is simply out of your control, and it occurs much too quickly to avoid it.  This fact about our psychologies, that we cannot resist some of our beliefs, is what accounts for our entitlements.  As Dretske says, “We have a right to accept what we are powerless to reject” (2000, p. 598).  In saying this, Dretske appeals to the well-known principle that ‘Ought implies Can’.  Given that you are unable to refrain from believing BRIGHT, it would be unreasonable to suppose that you epistemically ought not to believe it.  If this is correct, then we can see how your brain-in-a-vat twin is entitled to believe BRIGHT.  Although her experience of the screen is inaccurate, and her perceptual system is unreliable, she enjoys an entitlement to her belief because she is equally as compelled to form the belief as you are.

Entitlements are defeated when the formation of a belief is avoidable, that is, when there are things the subject could have done, or more precisely, should have done that would have prevented her from being caused to believe.  Suppose, for example, that you have independent evidence from a credible source that you are now looking at a well-crafted poster of a computer screen instead of a real one.  Suppose further that you disregard this evidence, so that when you have the experience of a bright screen you are caused to believe BRIGHT.  In this sort of case you lack an entitlement to this belief, because had you been properly responsive to the evidence in your possession, your experience would have failed to cause you to believe BRIGHT.  One might interject here that this suggestion runs contrary to Dretske’s original proposal, because even though you have ignored the countervailing evidence, you still cannot avoid being compelled to believe BRIGHT when you had the experience.  In response, Dretske maintains that entitlements should be reserved only for those beliefs that an epistemically responsible agent could not avoid being caused to form in similar circumstances.  Because of this, given that you have this evidence, you epistemically ought to refrain from believing BRIGHT.  Analogously, when a drunk driver accidentally runs over a child in the street, it may be that the driver is, at that time, in a situation where hitting the child was unavoidable.  We do not say, though, that the driver therefore had the right to run over the child.  The reason the driver is culpable for the accident is that were she more responsible, she would have taken measures to ensure that she did not get into the situation in the first place (for example, by taking a taxi home rather than driving).  Similarly, even if you cannot avoid being caused by your experience to believe BRIGHT, your entitlement to that belief is stripped because a responsible agent in that same circumstance, recognizing that she has evidence that she is looking at a computer-screen poster, would have avoided being so caused.

We will now consider two objections to Dretske’s view.  First, Michael Williams (2000) rejects Dretske’s contention that epistemic rights can exist in the complete absence of any epistemic duties.  Given that Dretske takes entitlements to be defeasible rights, it is plausible that were one’s belief challenged by another person, that would cancel the entitlement one had to that belief.  The only way to re-establish the entitlement, it seems, would be by providing reasons that defeat the challenge.  If this is right, it suggests that Dretske overstates his position that entitlements are completely free of justificational obligations.  While it may be correct that we need not actively provide positive evidential backing for every belief to which we are entitled, having an entitlement requires that one at least be able to justify or defend one’s belief in situations when one is presented with an appropriate challenge.  As Williams notes, defeasibility and justificational commitments go together.  The result, presumably, is that most young children and unreflective adults would lack entitlements to many of their perceptual and memorial beliefs, for they may lack the cognitive resources needed to be able to defend their own beliefs. However, this is a result some philosophers are willing to accept.

As for the second objection, many philosophers think that insofar as entitlements are epistemic goods that contribute to knowledge, they must be suitably connected to truth; they must be truth-conducive, or have a sufficiently high likelihood of being true.  But this suggestion appears to be at odds with Dretske’s claim that your brain-in-a-vat mental twin, whose beliefs are almost all false, is entitled to the same beliefs that you are.  One way epistemologists sometimes react to the New Evil Demon Problem is to draw a distinction between two kinds of epistemic standings: being epistemically blameless for holding a belief, on the one hand, and being fully entitled (or justified or warranted) in holding a belief, such that having this property makes an essential contribution to knowledge, on the other (see Pryor 2001).  According to this distinction, whereas you are entitled to the belief (and also know) that BRIGHT, your envatted twin is merely blameless when she forms the same belief.  It is through no fault of her own that she arrives at a false, unreliably-produced belief; nonetheless, she lacks an epistemic right which you possess.  She is simply unlucky that her experiences and beliefs are not connected to the external world in the proper way.

In response to this charge, one could claim that the envatted subject’s beliefs are conducive to truth, but only relative to more favorable environments (see Goldman 1986 and Henderson & Horgan 2006).  Given that the brain in a vat is a responsible agent, her beliefs would be mostly true if she were in an environment similar to the actual one.  Alternatively, one could deny that a distinction between being blameless and being entitled (or justified or warranted) exists at all.  The suggestion would be that to be justly entitled is for you (or an epistemically responsible agent) to be blameless in holding the belief (for defenders of this move see Ginet 1975, Chisholm 1977, and Bonjour 1985; for objections see Alston 1989a).  Whether either of these options have promise, however, is something that Dretske would need to argue for.

2. Burge on Entitlement

Tyler Burge has argued that “[w]e are entitled to rely, other things equal, on perception, memory, deductive and inductive reasoning, and on…the word of others” (1993, p. 458).  Because his work on perceptual entitlement is arguably the most developed, we shall focus our attention on perceptual beliefs: beliefs non-inferentially based on a perceptual experience.

Burge begins by introducing the concept of warrant, which he says is the most fundamental type of epistemic good.  What makes it specifically an epistemic good is that a belief’s being warranted depends first and foremost on its being a good route to truth.  Yet, it also depends on the subject’s own limitations: what information the subject has; what information is available; and how well that information is used.  Thus, when he says warrant must be a good route to truth, he does not mean that warranted beliefs necessarily are true; one can be warranted in a belief which happens to be false.  Nonetheless, the warranted subject must, at a minimum, be well-positioned to achieve truth.  Being warranted entails being reliable, that is, the productive warranted belief has a sufficiently high likelihood of being true (at least under normal circumstances).

Warrant is divided into two sub-species.  The first is justification.  Justification is epistemically internalist in the sense that it is warrant by reason that is conceptually accessible upon reflection to the subject.  Beliefs we are justified in holding are those that result from having engaged in reasoning or from having drawn an inference from other beliefs (Consider again the example from the previous section in which Johnson infers that Smith is guilty on the basis of her reasons that Smith’s fingerprints were on the murder weapon and he had motive to kill).  But when we turn to the epistemology of perceptual belief, Burge thinks the transition from a perceptual state (for example, seeing a round and red apple on the table) to a belief (for example, APPLE: There is round and red apple there) is nothing at all like drawing an inference.  In most typical situations, we do not reason our way from experience to belief; hence the warrant for our perceptual beliefs must not come in the form of justification.  There are two primary reasons why Burge thinks this is so.  First, reasoning is a sophisticated, intellectual mental exercise.  The capacities necessary for reasoning are too complex for us to plausibly attribute them to certain groups of individuals, like children and higher non-human animals.  If justification were the only form of warrant that there is, these individuals’ perceptual beliefs would lack warrant; yet it is commonly thought that these individuals are no less warranted in their perceptual beliefs than mature adults are.  The second reason why it’s wrong to think we reason from experience to belief is that reasoning essentially involves progressing from one or more propositional attitudes one has, like a belief, to another as one would draw a conclusion from the premises of an argument.  But Burge argues that perceptual states are not propositional attitudes.  In other words, perception has nonpropositional content (see also Evans 1982, Peacock 2001, Heck 2007).  Whereas a belief’s content (or what that belief concerns or is about) has predicational (or sentence-like) structure, perceptual content does not.  The content of a perceptual state is more akin to a topographical map rather than a sentence. (For more on nonpropositional perceptual content, see Peacocke 1992.) Therefore, unlike beliefs, experiences are not the kinds of mental states from which one can draw inferences.  Nonetheless, what is common among beliefs and perceptual states, and unlike other kinds of mental states like wishes and imaginings, is that they are both capable of being veridical: they have accuracy conditions that can be either satisfied or unsatisfied.

Given that perceptual beliefs are not justified in the sense just described, the type of warrant they receive must come under a different form.  This brings us to the second sub-species of warrant: entitlement.  Burgean entitlement is epistemically externalist in the sense that it is warrant that need not be fully conceptually accessible to the subject.  Like Dretskean entitlement, one can have a Burgean entitlement to a perceptual belief, such as APPLE, without knowing or justifiably believing that one does.  Also similar to Dretske’s view is the claim that entitlement is a defeasible kind of epistemic good: it can be defeated by independent reasons one may have for doubting that one’s perceptual faculties are properly functioning or that the believed proposition in question is true.  Thus, absent reasons for doubt, one has an entitlement to conceptualize one’s perceptual experience in the form of a belief (for example, to believe APPLE when one has an experience of a round, red apple).

As one clarification, Burge’s claim is not that entitlement is the only kind of warrant that can attach to perceptual beliefs.  People certainly can, and do, reason and deliberate about these sorts of beliefs.  One can think, for example: “There appears to be a round and red apple, and when things appear this way they generally turn out to be accurate.  Therefore, there is a round and red apple there.”  This is a perfectly permissible way to reason, and doing so can result in acquiring a justification in addition to the perceptual entitlement one already possesses.  The crucial point is that securing a warrant for this belief does not require that one reasons, or be able to reason, in this way.  To impose such a requirement on all forms of warrant would result, as Burge says, in hyper-intellectualizing perceptual belief.

The key question Burge wants to answer is: What is the contribution of perceptual states per se to entitlements to perceptual beliefs?  He thinks that two conditions must be met in order for a perceptual state to award the subject the epistemic right to believe as that state represents the world as being.  To understand what these conditions are, it is important first to appreciate Burge’s claim that the perceptual system has a characteristic function.  Some philosophers have argued that the function of any natural system can only be understood in terms of how it contributes to meeting the basic biological needs of the organism (see Millikan 1984).  For example, on this view the perceptual system functions well only insofar as it enables the perceiver to identify mates, avoid predators, find food, and so on.  Burge, however, distances himself from this sort of explanation.  He holds instead that it is known on a priori grounds that the perceptual system is a representational system that has the function to represent the subject’s environment veridically and reliably (2003, p. 508).  Although he agrees that reliable perception can, and oftentimes does, contribute to satisfying one’s biological needs (for example, being able to perceptually discriminate different colors can help one spot red berries to eat in a green forest), it is a mistake for philosophers to attempt to reduce the perceptual system’s function or explain it solely in terms of biological fitness.  The sense in which the perceptual system “has done a good job” in a given situation should be evaluated in terms of its capacity for producing veridical perceptual states.

Provided that this is the perceptual system’s function, there is the further question of how the system is capable of producing states that accurately represent the environment.  Burge’s answer centers on the thesis of perceptual anti-individualism (sometimes called perceptual content externalism).  According to this thesis, the nature of a perceptual state (what that state represents) is partially determined by a history of causal interactions that have occurred between objects and properties in the environment, on the one hand, and the perceiver, or the perceiver’s evolutionary ancestors, on the other (see Burge 2003; 2005, Section I; 2007, Introduction; 2007a).  What explains the fact that you are capable of (accurately or inaccurately) perceptually representing, say, shapes like roundness and colors like redness in the environment is that you, within your own lifetime, or your ancestors throughout the evolution of the species, regularly came into contact with various features in the environment, such as instances of these very shapes and colors.  According to the view, these causal interactions help to establish the principles that govern the formation of the perceptual system’s states and inform the perceptual system of what it ought to represent when it is presented, in a given situation, with some array of stimuli (for example, light waves impacting the retina in the eyes or sound waves impacting the ear drums).

Thus one of the conditions that must be met for a perceptual state to confer an entitlement to a corresponding perceptual belief is that the state is anti-individualistically individuated.  The other condition is as follows: one has an entitlement to believe as one’s perceptual state represents the environment as being, only if that type of perceptual state is reliably veridical in the subject’s normal environment.  Burge defines the normal environment as the one in which the contents of the subject’s perceptual states are established.  What this means is that for those perceptual states that do deliver entitlements, the existence of those types of perceptual states (for example, a state indicating roundness or redness) is explained by a history of causal interactions that were highly successful.  That is, one has the general ability to perceptually represent property F because the perceptual system, in its evolutionary development, regularly confronted instances of F-ness in the environment.  Thus, the normal environment might be where one currently lives, but it need not be.  It is possible that the environment a subject currently lives in is different from the one in which her perceptual system evolved, where she, or her ancestors, first acquired the abilities to represent various objects and properties.

The reason why this second condition is important is that entitlement, insofar as it is a type of epistemic warrant, must be a good route to truth.  Provided that perceptual states are established by high degrees of successful interactions with features in the environment, and hence are reliably veridical in the normal environment, “[v]eridicality enters into the very nature of perceptual states and abilities.” (Burge 2003, p. 532) To rely on a particular perceptual state the general type of which was established in this fashion in the formation of a belief makes it likely that that belief is true in the normal environment.

Burge goes on to argue that when these two conditions are met (that is, the perceptual state is anti-individualistically individuated and it is reliably veridical in the normal environment) one has a defeasible entitlement to rely on that state in any environment.  This further point provides a novel solution to the New Evil Demon Problem, which was discussed in the previous section.  Recall that this problem draws on a commonly held intuition that subjects in skeptical situations can hold warranted beliefs.  Suppose you are a regular embodied person, and an apple on the table causes you to have a perceptual experience of a round and red apple, which subsequently causes you to believe APPLE.  At the very next instant you are unknowingly transported to a different world where your brain is placed in a vat, and a computer produces the same experiences you were just having in your regular embodied state.  You have the exact same experience of a round and red apple, except that now the experience is inaccurate (there are no apples nearby, just other brains and computer equipment).  Not only is your belief false, it was produced by an unreliable process relative to this new environment.  Nevertheless, you still possess an entitlement to this belief, because the perceptual state that produced it (that is, your experience of the round and red apple) is reliably veridical, relative to the normal environment.  Because it was interactions with genuine apples (in the actual world) and instances of roundness and redness that helped to establish this type of perceptual state, you retain the epistemic right to believe as your experience represents, even though it is currently not at all indicative of what is going on in this new hostile environment.

We will now consider two criticisms of Burgean entitlement.  As for the first criticism, Burge states explicitly that his view of entitlement is not meant to speak to the problem of skepticism.  His objective is not to prove that we have perceptual entitlements, but rather to explain on the assumption that we do have them what they are.  But some epistemologists might urge that skepticism needs to be addressed in order to get his view off the ground.  Skeptical issues have typically been raised in connection with epistemic closure, which states roughly:

(Closure)    If subject S is warranted in believing that p, and S knows that p logically entails q, and S deduces q on the basis of p, then S is warranted in believing that q.

Suppose I have a warrant in the form of a Burgean perceptual entitlement to believe HAND (that I have hands).  HAND logically entails ~BIV (that I am not a handless brain in a vat).  According to Closure, I would be warranted in believing ~BIV were I to deduce it from HAND.  But many think this procedure makes it much too easy to secure warrant for beliefs like ~BIV.  It is unclear what Burge’s position on this matter is, but it is something he may need to speak to if his view is to be tenable.  Note finally that Dretske is not faced with the same problem, because he rejects closure altogether (Dretske 2005).

A different sort of criticism has to do with whether there is any real conceptual difference between how Burge characterizes entitlement and how other epistemologists have characterized justification.  Albert Casullo (2009) argues that there is not.  As we have seen, the chief distinction between justification and entitlement, according to Burge, is:

(ACC) Justification is warrant that is conceptually accessible to the subject, and entitlement is warrant that need not be conceptually accessible to the subject.

It is not immediately clear, says Casullo, what is meant by the term ‘access’ or ‘accessible’, and he suggests three possible interpretations:

A1) Subject S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the epistemic ground that warrants S’s belief, that is, to the content of S’s warranting experience or belief.

A2) S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the adequacy of that ground, that is, to the justification for the belief that S’s ground is adequate to warrant the belief that p.

A3) S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the epistemic principle governing the ground of S’s belief that p, that is, to the conditions under which the ground warrants the belief that p and the conditions under which that warrant is undermined.

Bearing these separate interpretations in mind, Casullo provides textual evidence from Burge’s works that ACC should be read as claiming that justification satisfies A1 and A3 but not A2, whereas entitlement satisfies A1 but not A2 or A3.  But if this is the sense in which entitlements need not be accessible to the subject, this is just the view William Alston (1989b) had already proposed, which he calls an internalist externalism account of justification.  Thus, Casullo contends that any differences that exist between Burgean entitlement and Alstonian justification are terminological at best.

3. Wright on Entitlement

Crispin Wright’s approach to entitlement is motivated primarily by an attempt to ward off skeptical paradoxes.  In his (2004) paper, “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” he introduces the notion of a “cornerstone proposition” for a given region of thought, according to which “it would follow from a lack of warrant for it that one could not rationally claim warrant for any belief in that region” (p. 167-68).  The skeptical project involves two steps: (1) make a case that a certain proposition, which we characteristically accept, is a cornerstone for a much wider class of belief, and (2) argue that we lack warrant for that proposition.  Wright then identifies two general patterns of skeptical reasoning that deploy these two steps.  The first comes from the Cartesian skeptic, who argues that the proposition that we are not cognitively detached from reality (instances of which come in the more common skeptical-scenario varieties like ‘I am not dreaming’ or ‘I am not a brain in a vat’, and so forth) is a cornerstone proposition for our ordinary perceptual beliefs. As for this latter claim, the skeptic reasons that for any procedure one might utilize to try to determine, say, that one is not dreaming (for example, pinching oneself or trying to read the lines of a newspaper), one must already have an independent warrant for thinking that the procedure was executed properly, and moreover that one did not simply dream carrying it out.  But since utilizing any such procedure would require that one already have warrant for believing that one is not dreaming, there is no procedure one could effectively utilize to gain a warrant for this proposition.  Thus, our perceptual beliefs are unwarranted.

The second kind of skeptic, the Humean skeptic, reveals an implicit circularity embedded in our practices of inductive reasoning, where the observance of facts about a sample population causes us to make a claim about all of the population’s members (for example, the inference from ‘All observed Fs are G’ to ‘All Fs are G’).  The inductive inference relies on one’s being warranted in accepting a cornerstone proposition, which Wright calls the Uniformity Thesis: that nature abounds in regularities.  However, there is no way to gain warrant for the Uniformity Thesis, because this could only be accomplished by relying on induction itself (For an overview of the Humean Problem of Induction, see Stroud 1977).

According to Wright, the skeptical problem can be generalized in the following way:  Let P be a proposition representing some feature of observable reality (for example, ‘I have hands’), where the best and as the skeptic will argue only evidence in favor of P is rooted in perceptual experience.  To arrive at an anti-skeptical conclusion, one will typically deploy what Wright calls the I-II-III argument:

I: My current experience is in all respects as if P


III: There is a material world

The same argumentative structure can be utilized to refute skepticisms of a variety of subject matters.  For instance, where I stands for ‘X’s behavior and physical condition are in all respects as if X is in mental state M’, III stands for ‘There are minds besides my own’.  Or where I stands for ‘I seem to remember it being the case that P yesterday’, III stands for ‘The world did not come into being today replete with apparent traces of a more extended history’.  Although the I-II-III argument may appear to warrant the conclusion, Wright contests that it engenders a failure of warrant transmission, a notion he has developed (2003).  According to Wright, it is oftentimes the case that a body of evidence e is an information-dependent warrant for a proposition P, where e is an information-dependent warrant for P if whether e is correctly regarded as warranting P depends on what one has by way of collateral information C.  In cases where C is entailed by P, the warrant for P (which is sourced in e) would fail to transmit to C, were one to infer C from P.  Setting the skeptical problem aside for the moment, consider one of Wright’s own examples.  Suppose that e is your experience of seeing a ball kicked into a net, from which you infer P, the proposition that a goal has just been scored.  Let C be the proposition that a soccer game is in progress.  Now, although C is a logical consequence of P, were you to start with e and infer P and subsequently deduce C, this chain of reasoning could not provide you with any new warrant for believing C, because e’s warranting you in believing P presupposes that you already have a warrant for believing C.  That is, the warrant for P fails to transmit to C because P cannot be warranted (by e) unless C is something for which you already have warrant.

Returning to the anti-skeptical I-II-III argument, Wright claims that III (‘There is an external world’) is a cornerstone proposition for a range of observation-sourced propositions which may be expressed by II (for example, ‘I have hands’).  The point is that whether I successfully warrants II depends on one’s already having warrant for III.  But the warrant for III cannot come by way of the I-II-III argument.  One crucial difference between this situation and the soccer example is that whereas there are means by which you can secure independent warrant for the proposition that a soccer game is in progress (you can, for example, look up the start time of the game in the local newspaper), there appears to be no way to acquire warrant, independent of one’s experiential evidence, for the proposition that there is an external world.  The skeptic will therefore conclude that type-III propositions are unwarranted, and as they are cornerstones so are the associated type-II propositions.

Wright’s aim is not to defend but rather to alleviate skeptical worries.  His strategy is to argue that we do possess warrant for type-III cornerstone propositions, but that warrant does not come in the form of evidential justification, as the skeptic assumes it must.  He says:

Suppose there is a type of rational warrant which one does not have to do any specific evidential work to earn: better, a type of rational warrant whose possession does not require the existence of evidence in the broadest sense encompassing both a priori and empirical considerations for the truth of the warranted proposition.  Call it entitlement.  If I am entitled to accept P, then my doing so is beyond rational reproach even though I can point to no cognitive accomplishment in my life, whether empirical or a priori, inferential or non-inferential, whose upshot could reasonably be contended to be that I had come to know that P, or had succeeded in getting evidence justifying P (2004, p. 174-75).

According to Wright, we have entitlements to accept various cornerstone propositions, such as: ‘There is an external world’; ‘There are other minds’; ‘The world has an ancient past’; and ‘There are regularities present in nature’.  Entitlement is a kind of rational warrant that, unlike justification, does not depend on one’s having evidence one could point to that would speak to the truth of the proposition in question.  Whereas Detective Johnson’s believing that Smith is guilty of the murder is underwritten by her own cognitive accomplishment, by way of basing that belief on recognizable empirical evidence (see Section I above), and is therefore justified, entitlements are secured in a different way.  Similar to the views of both Dretske and Burge, having a Wrightean entitlement to accept a proposition does not require that one be able to think about what it is that gives one the entitlement (Wright 2007, Fn 6).  If Wright’s proposal is tenable, we find a way to circumvent the skeptical problem: we have unearned warrants (in the form of entitlements) to type-III propositions that are acquired independently of the I-II-III argument. Hence the skeptic has no grounds for accusing the anti-skeptic of viciously circular reasoning.

It is helpful to briefly compare and contrast Wrightean entitlement with the Burgean view discussed in the previous section.  One interesting similarity has to do with the connection between entitlement and justification as they relate to the structure of our warranted beliefs.  For both Burge and Wright, entitlements reside at the very foundation of the epistemic architecture of our beliefs.  All of our justified beliefs are ultimately based upon, or at least presuppose, entitlements.  For this reason, defenders of the entitlement-justification distinction are naturally affiliated with foundationalism, the view that there exist warranted beliefs which are not themselves warranted, or justified, by any further beliefs to which one could appeal.  In contrast, those who deny that such a distinction exists naturally steer toward coherentism or holism (see Sellars 1963, Davidson 1986, Cohen 2002).  However, Burge and Wright differ with respect to the propositions they claim reside at the foundation.  As we saw in the previous section, Burgean entitlements attach to beliefs concerning ordinary objects and properties in the world, which are non-inferentially sourced in perception, testimony, and memory.  The beliefs we rationally infer on the basis of them are justified.  In contrast, Wrightean entitlements attach to cornerstone propositions.  Although we do not typically infer further propositions on the basis of them, cornerstones provide the vital preconditions needed for our experiences or memory states to evidentially justify other (type-II) propositions.

Related to this last point, Burge can be seen as taking a liberal stance toward perceptual warrant, in that one’s experience alone provides one with immediate, non-inferential warrant for one’s perceptual beliefs.  In contrast, Wright adopts epistemic conservatism, according to which an experience provides warrant for a perceptual belief only on the condition that one has a prior warrant to accept the relevant type-III propositions (The terms ‘liberal’ and ‘conservative’ in epistemology are due to Pryor 2004.  See also Wright 2007).

One question that Wright raises is: What do our entitlements give us the right to do? Whereas for both Dretske and Burge our entitlements are rights to believe propositions, Wright has a different answer.  He suggests that part of what it is to hold a belief attitude toward a proposition is for that attitude to be controlled by reasoning and evidence.  Since entitlements are characteristically unaccompanied by evidence, he denies that they attach to belief.  Rather, where P is a proposition to which we have an entitlement, we are entitled to accept P.  Acceptance is a general kind of attitude of which belief is only one mode.  But, if belief is not the appropriate mode of acceptance for entitlement, what is it?  One suggestion Wright considers is ‘acting on the assumption that P’, but he immediately dismisses this because one can surely act on the assumption that a proposition is true while at the same time remaining agnostic or even skeptical of its truth.  Because entitlements provide essential preconditions for our having any warrant at all, whatever kind of attitude we have entitlements to must be something wherein one’s coming to doubt its truth would commit one to doubting the competence of the particular project in question.  Wright in the end settles on our having an entitlement to rationally trust P, where trust is a kind of acceptance weaker than belief (because it is not controlled by evidence), but stronger than acting on the assumption (because one is non-evidentially committed to the truth of P).

Wright’s position on what we have entitlements to raises a serious question regarding epistemic closure, according to which it is a necessary condition on being justified in believing P that one is also justified in believing those propositions one knows to be entailed by P.  Thus, given that my experience as of hands justifies me in believing HAND (the type-II proposition that I have hands), and I know that this entails ~BIV (the type-III proposition that I am not a handless brain in a vat) I must also be justified, according to closure, in believing ~BIV.  Yet, although Wright maintains that we have non-evidential entitlements to rationally trust type-III propositions, he denies that we are justified in believing them.  His proposal, therefore, appears to be at odds with closure.

In response to this alleged problem, Wright advises that we should qualify standard closure principles in such a way that we need not accept that evidentially justified belief is closed under known entailment.  Rather, if we let warrant range disjunctively over both entitlement and justification, we can allow that warranted acceptance (which ranges over belief; taking for granted; rational trust; acting on the assumption; and so forth) is so closed.  Thus, given that I am warranted in accepting HAND (in the form of a justified belief), and also that I know HAND entails ~BIV, I am warranted in accepting ~BIV (in the form of an entitled trust).  The upshot is that the warrant for a type-III proposition does not come by way inferring it from the related type-II proposition (for the type-II fails to transmit its warrant to the type-III), but this is nonetheless consistent with Wright’s qualified closure principle.

We will now consider two possible objections to Wright’s view.  As for the first objection, many will agree that:

(*) If it were antecedently reasonable to reject a type-III proposition, the warrant for the relevant type-II propositions would be removed.

The skeptic takes this thought one step further and concludes that:

(**) Type-II propositions can be warranted only if it is antecedently reasonable to accept type-III propositions.

Wright endorses (**), prompting him to characterize entitlements as positive warrants to trust.  However, Martin Davies (2004) has argued that by accepting (**), Wright concedes too much to the skeptic.  Instead, Davies claims that the inference from (*) to (**) is invalid: from the fact that my having reasonable doubt that ~BIV would defeat my warrant for believing HAND, it does not follow that I must have warrant for ~BIV in order to have warrant for HAND.  An alternative strategy would be to agree that doubt of ~BIV would defeat the warrant for HAND, while at the same time denying that one needs warranted trust in ~BIV in order for my experience as of hands to warrant HAND.  Davies thinks both of these claims can be met by attributing a different kind of entitlement to type-III propositions like ~BIV.  His suggestion is that we have entitlements not to doubt, not to call in question, or not to bother about, type-III propositions (2004, p. 226).  Thus, whereas a Wrightean entitlement is an entitlement to adopt a positive attitude of trust, Davies holds that it is an entitlement to adopt a negative attitude of not doubting; one would not need any positive warrant, earned or unearned, for type-III propositions to have warrant for type-II propositions.  One could take this approach one step even further and claim that type-II propositions do, contrary to what Wright says, transmit their warrants to type-III propositions.  In other words, the I-II-III argument is epistemically victorious: where I have no reason to doubt that I am a brain in a vat, my experience as of hands warrants me in believing HAND, which thereby warrants me in believing ~BIV when I draw the inference.  Whether or not this is a plausible anti-skeptical outcome is highly controversial (For a defense, see Pryor 2000 and 2004; for a rejection, see Cohen 2002).

A second objection to Wright’s view comes from Carrie Jenkins (2007), who has argued that even if we grant Wright that it is rational for us to accept, without evidence, cornerstone propositions, this cannot be an epistemic kind of rationality.  For any proposition P, one can be epistemically rational in accepting P only if one’s acceptance is brought about in a way that addresses the specific question of whether P is true.  Thus, in order for it to be epistemically rational of you to accept the proposition that China is the most populous country, your coming into this state of acceptance must be due, in part at least, to the fact that you take it to be true that China is the most populous country.  However, where P is a cornerstone proposition, like “My sensory apparatus is properly connected to the external world,” one’s acceptance of P is divorced from any considerations on the truth or falsity of P.  Instead, on the Wrightean view, accepting P is rational, roughly, because its acceptance is necessary in order to undertake the indispensible cognitive project of forming beliefs about the world based on perception.  This is a different kind of rationality, grounded not in terms of whether P is true, but in what fortunate consequences would result from one’s accepting P.  This is similar to the sense in which it would be rational (perhaps practically rational) for a runner in a race to believe she is not tired, since the act of forming this belief could actually prevent her from slowing down in the race.  It is doubtful that we could have epistemic entitlements to cornerstone propositions without it being epistemically rational to accept them.  This creates an obstacle for Wright given that his ultimate aim is to resolve the problem of skepticism in epistemology.

4. Peacocke on Entitlement

In his book, The Realm of Reason, Christopher Peacocke argues that we have entitlements to our perceptual beliefs, a priori beliefs, beliefs based on inductive inference, beliefs about our own actions, and moral beliefs.  Our entitlements to the latter four classes of belief are explained as extensions and consequences of the explanatory structure of our entitlement to perceptual beliefs.  Accordingly, this section will focus on Peacocke’s account of perceptual entitlement.

Peacocke does not distinguish entitlement from justification in the way that Dretske, Burge, and Wright do.  His notion of ‘entitlement’ is intended to range over both inferential and non-inferential transitions between mental states.  For Peacocke, entitlement plays a more central role in epistemology, for he claims that a judgment or belief is knowledge only if it is reached by a transition to which the subject is entitled.  Indeed, at times he seems to use the terms ‘entitlement’ and ‘justification’ interchangeably.  So, whereas for Dretske, Burge, and Wright, entitlements and justifications are distinct epistemic goods that make separable contributions to knowledge, Peacocke seems only to be operating with one epistemic concept, which he frequently refers to as entitlement.  As for another difference, we saw that entitlements for Burge and Dretske attach to beliefs, while Wrightean entitlements attach to attitudes of rational trust.  For Peacocke, we have entitlements not only to beliefs or judgments, but also to the transitions that link beliefs to antecedent mental states.  So, part of what it takes to have a perceptual entitlement to the belief, for example, that there is something round ahead, is that one is also entitled to the transition that brings one from having an experience of something round to the formation of that belief.  Nonetheless, a crucial element of Peacockean entitlement common to those of the other three authors discussed in this article is his position that “[a] thinker may be entitled to make a judgment without having the capacity to think about the states which entitle him to make the judgment” (2004, p. 7).

In order to understand Peacocke’s account of perceptual entitlement, it is important first to appreciate two conditions he thinks any transition must meet in order to award a subject an entitlement.  The first condition is conveyed in what he calls the Special Truth Conduciveness Thesis:

A fundamental and irreducible part of what makes a transition one to which one is entitled is that the transition tends to lead to true judgments…in a distinctive way characteristic of rational transitions (2004, p. 11).

Here we see that Peacocke agrees with Burge that entitlement (or for Burge, all forms of warrant) must be a good route to truth.  A necessary condition on entitlement for both Peacocke and Burge is that whichever state produces the entitled judgment or belief is a reliable indicator of the way things are in the world.  Note that this condition is not necessary for Dretskean entitlement, for it could be that a fully responsible agent cannot avoid believing there to be a bright screen ahead of her while her perceptual faculties are in fact highly unreliable (as would be the case were the agent a brain in a vat).  But the principle also implies that not just any transition leading to true judgments is sufficient for an entitlement.  In addition, the transition must be one that is characteristic of rational transitions.  Some processes encompass transitions between states which are highly reliable, yet these transitions are not what we would consider rational.  For example, suppose that due to some psychological defect, whenever I see a cardinal fly above me, this visual experience causes me to judge that the St. Louis Cardinals baseball team won today.  By sheer coincidence the only time that I see cardinals flying are on days when the Cardinals happen to win.  This transition between the state of seeing a cardinal and the state of judging that the Cardinals won tends to lead to true judgments, yet it is clear that it is quite irrational of me to form these judgments (for a similar sort of example, see Bonjour 1985).  What, then, is it that distinguishes specifically rational transitions?  The answer is given by what Peacocke calls the Rationalist Dependence Thesis, which is the second condition necessary for securing an entitlement:

The rational truth-conduciveness of any given transition to which a thinker is entitled is to be philosophically explained in terms of the nature of the intentional contents and states involved in the transition (2004, p. 52).

According to this second condition, whether or not a transition is rational depends on the specific explanation for why that transition is reliable.  The feature that is characteristic of rational transitions, according to Peacocke, is that they are reliable because of the very nature of the mental states involved, the contents that they have and how it is that those states are capable of representing the world in a certain way.  If the reliability of some transition is explained by something other than the very identity of the states involved in the transition and the individuation of their contents (such as if it were some mere accident that a type of experience reliably led to true judgments, as in the cardinal example above), then that transition, though reliable, would not be rational and would therefore fail to yield any entitlement.

With the two above theses introduced, we see that transitions between states yield entitlements only if they are conducive to truth, and furthermore their being reliable can be philosophically explained in terms of the states involved in the transition.  With regard to perceptual entitlement in particular, the kinds of experiences Peacocke thinks are relevant to meeting this criterion are those which have instance-individuated contents, such as the experience expressed by “That thing looks round.”  What makes this experience’s content instance-individuated is that when one’s perceptual faculties are properly functioning, and the environment is normal, one’s having this experience with this content is “caused by the holding of the condition which is in fact the correctness condition for that content” (2004, p. 67).  In simpler terms, the correct perceptual representation of an object as round does not causally depend on any other mental states or relations aside from the subject’s being properly connected to that round object in the world.  In contrast, an experience expressed by “There looks to be a soldier over there” does not have instance-individuated content because one’s correctly representing a soldier causally depends not only on there being a soldier where one represents it as being, but also on the background empirical knowledge one needs to have of what it is to be a soldier, how soldiers typically dress, and so on.

A Peacockean perceptual entitlement can thus be described as follows: “A subject enjoying an experience with a content which is instance-individuated is entitled to judge that content (that is, accept that experience at face value), in the absence of reasons for doubting that she is perceiving properly.”  Note that in the presence of reasons for doubt, one’s entitlement is removed.  Thus, Peacockean entitlement, like that of Dretske, Burge and Wright, has defeasibility conditions built into it.

The central task for Peacocke is to offer a philosophical explanation of the entitlement relation between experiences with instance-individuated contents and their corresponding perceptual judgments, which will consist of an a priori argument that demonstrates that the transitions between these states are conducive to truth.  His strategy is to argue that the existence of perceptual experiences with instance-individuated contents is best explained by the fact that those experiences are produced by a device that evolved by natural selection to represent the world to the subject, and that the perceptual experiences produced in the subject are predominantly correct.  Moreover, judgments based on these experiences are likely to be true.  To defend this claim, he relies on what he calls the Complexity Reduction Principle:

Other things equal, good explanations of complex phenomena explain the more complex in terms of the less complex; they reduce complexity (2004, p. 83).

This principle describes a key feature of what makes an explanation a good one.  When we are presented with some complex phenomenon, the explanation we should endorse, out of all the alternatives, is the one that explains the phenomenon in the least complex terms.  By accepting this principle, we are accepting that “it is…more rational to hold, other things equal, that [things] have come about in an easy, rather than in a highly improbable, way” (2004, p. 83).  Consider one of Peacocke’s own cases stemming from natural science.  Every snowflake contains six identical patterns separated by sixty-degree segments around its center.  This is an example of a complex phenomenon, one that immediately strikes us as highly improbable.  The best explanation for why snowflakes exhibit this pattern will inform us, by reducing complexity, that the alleged improbability is merely apparent: oxygen molecules in frozen water are roughly spherical and they are arranged on a plane.  The frozen crystals grow in a way that minimizes energy, and the most energy-efficient way of packing spheres on a plane results in a hexagonal arrangement (2004, p. 75-6).  One possible alternative explanation could be that snowflakes are built on skeletons that exhibit six-fold symmetry.  However, the latter explanation is less preferable to the former, because the latter is no less complex than the phenomenon itself: we would simply shift the question to why it is that the skeleton, rather than the snowflake, exhibits this pattern.

Like the example of snowflakes, our having experiences with instance-individuated contents is a highly complex phenomenon.  That the perceptual system produces states that are in large part correct, and was naturally selected to accurately represent the world to the subject, explains the phenomenon with the least amount of complexity.  A subject’s being in a state of perceptually representing an object o as having property F would not appear improbable if an Fo in the environment caused the state, and the subject had a properly functioning system that had adapted over the millennia, by way of interacting with objects like o’s and properties like F-ness, to accurately represent features in the environment.  It is a virtue of this explanation that it does not posit any further representational states that are equally as complex as the perceptual states under discussion and are, in turn, in need of explanation.

Peacocke argues further that the proposed explanation succeeds at reducing complexity better than alternative skeptical hypotheses.  There are two general types of such hypotheses he considers.  The first is one in which the subject’s illusory perceptual states are produced by some intentional agent, such as the Cartesian Demon.  In this scenario, it is typically postulated that the deceiver either has experiences herself, in which case our perceptual states get explained in terms of another’s perceptual states, or she lacks experiences but has other intentional states with comparable complexity.  Either way, the hypothesis purporting to explain the phenomenon under discussion would stand in need of further explanation.  In the second type of skeptical hypothesis, our illusory experiences are not intentionally produced, but are instead generated randomly or coincidentally, such as your being a member of a randomly generated universe containing nothing but a population of deluded brains in vats (see Putnam 2000).  However, this sort of hypothesis involves highly complex initial conditions, such as the original set up describing how the vats are capable of producing conscious, intentional states.  Thus, it fails to reduce the complexity of the phenomenon of our having perceptual states.

To summarize, Peacocke justifies the claim that we are entitled to form judgments about the world on the basis of our experiences with instance-individuated contents, on the grounds that our having these experiences with these contents is best explained by the evolution of the perceptual system and its selection for accurate representation of the environment.  We will consider a number of criticisms of Peacocke’s view.  First, in attempting to give a philosophical explanation of the truth-conduciveness of the transition between experience and judgment, we have seen that Peacocke invokes the theory of natural selection.  But because his aim is to prove that our experiences are by and large correct, his argument cannot depend on any empirically justified premises.  However, natural selection is an empirical scientific theory that is justified in part by our experiences, so we should not expect that it could be used to answer the skeptic.  Peacocke insists though that his argument “does not have the truth of the whole empirical biological theory of evolution by natural selection as one of its premises” (2004, p. 98).  But if Peacocke’s argument is sound, and he is right that each premise is justified a priori, the implication, as Ralph Wedgwood (2007) notes, is that no scientific investigation was required whatsoever for Darwin to justify the claim that he evolved through natural selection—all he needed to do to learn that the theory of evolution is true was to engage in philosophical contemplation and to reflect on his own experiences.  But the suggestion that a theory such as this one could be justified a priori seems highly implausible.

Another challenge to Peacocke’s project is to question whether the natural selection-based explanation reduces complexity any more than the alternative explanations.  The skeptic will argue that the existence of living creatures and the evolution of psychological systems within some of its members is itself a complex phenomenon standing in need of further explanation.  In addition, the skeptic could reject the Complexity Reduction Principle altogether: that an explanation is simpler, or succeeds at reducing complexity, does not speak to whether it is the one we ought to accept (see Lycan 1988; for Peacocke’s response see 2004, p. 94-7).

Finally, even if we grant that the Complexity Reduction Principle is true and that the natural selection-based explanation demonstrates that judgments sourced in perception tend toward truth, one might still question whether it adequately demonstrates how transitions between experience and judgment are characteristically rational (that is, whether it appropriately conforms to the Rationalist Dependence Thesis).  In order for us to rationally rely on our (reliably accurate) experiences, is it the case that we must also know, or justifiably believe, that the natural selection-based explanation most reduces complexity?  Peacocke thinks the answer must be negative; otherwise, anyone unaware of the Complexity Reduction Principle (which, presumably, is most people) would lack entitlements to their perceptual beliefs, and moreover would lack perceptual knowledge.  Instead, he holds that it is sufficient that the transition from experience to judgment be rational from the subject’s own point of view, that is, that the subject appreciates that her experiential grounds for the transition to the judgment that P suffice for the truth of P (2004, p. 176).  However, Miguel Fernández (2006) notes a problem with this move.  When one comes to “appreciate one’s grounds,” this involves, at least on a natural interpretation of appreciate, that one forms an additional judgment, specifically, a second-order judgment of the form:

SOJ: This experience representing P provides adequate grounds for the truth of P.

Of course, if one’s judgment that SOJ is partially underwriting one’s entitlement to judge that P, then it must be that the transition leading one to judge SOJ is also rational from the subject’s own point of view.  To meet this requirement, however, one would need to then hold a third-order judgment of the form:

TOJ: My grounds for judging SOJ are adequate for the truth of SOJ.

The problem is that because TOJ would also need to be rational from the subject’s own point of view, we are forced into an implausible infinite regress of increasingly higher-order judgments, each used to rationalize the transition attached to the lower-ordered judgment.  Demanding that one form all of these judgments would seem to hyper-intellectualize perceptual entitlement, and it would go against Peacocke’s position, mentioned at the beginning of the section, that a subject can be entitled to a judgment without having the capacity to think about the states that entitle that judgment.  In order to avoid this undesirable outcome, Peacocke could attempt to elucidate the notion of “appreciating one’s grounds” in a way that does not suggest forming a higher-order judgment.  Or, if that option is not feasible, he could, in following Dretske and Burge, relinquish the requirement altogether that a transition be rational from the subject’s own point of view.

5. Conclusion

This article has explored the views of epistemic entitlement as presented by four prominent philosophers: Dretske, Burge, Wright, and Peacocke.  As we have seen, there are important similarities and differences among these views.  Burge and Peacocke both hold that reliability is necessary for enjoying perceptual entitlements, but also that the reliability must be explained in terms of the nature and individuation of the perceptual states involved.  For both Wright and Peacocke, their accounts of entitlement purport to provide anti-skeptical outcomes about knowledge, while Dretskean and Burgean entitlement is explained independently of the skeptical problem.  According to Dretske and Burge we have entitlements to hold various non-inferential beliefs.  In contrast, Wright holds that what we are entitled to do is to rationally trust certain corner stone propositions, like that there is an external world and there is a past.  Peacocke differs from the other three authors in that he claims that all rational judgments, as well as the transitions leading to those judgments, are underwritten by entitlements.  Despite these differences, one element common to each of the views we have discussed is the idea that entitlements are defeasible epistemic rights that are not grounded in conceptually accessible reasons or evidence.  One can have an entitlement even if one is unable to think about the states that provide the entitlement.  In this regard, distinguishing entitlement from justification has the advantage of attributing a kind of positive epistemic status to individuals who lack the critical reasoning skills needed to justify their own beliefs.  The inclusion of the concept of entitlement therefore steers away from hyper-intellectualizing the warrant for our basic beliefs about the world.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston W. (1989). Epistemic Justification: Essays in the Theory of Knowledge. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • A collection of essays on justification and knowledge written by William Alston.
  • Alston, W. (1989a). “The Deontological Conception of Epistemic Justification.” in Alston (1989).
    • Provides a series of arguments against deontological views of justification which center around the concepts of duty, praiseworthy, requirement, blameless by relying heavily on the impossibility of our having control over our beliefs.
  • Alston, W. (1989b). “An Internalist Externalism.” in Alston (1989).
    • Attempts to reconcile the internalism/externalism debate in epistemology by advancing a view of justification that incorporates both internalist and externalist elements.
  • Bach, K. (1985). “A Rationale for Reliabilism.” The Monist, 68: 246-265.
    • Defends reliabilism against its more well-known objections by drawing a distinction between a justified belief and a subject’s being justified in holding a belief.
  • Bonjour, L. (1985). The Structure of Empirical Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Develops an anti-foundationalist, coherentist theory of knowledge.
  • Burge, T. (1993). “Content Preservation.” The Philosophical Review, 102 (4): 457-488.
    • Argues that we have non-inferential entitlements to rely on the testimony of others.
  • Burge T. (1996). “Our Entitlement to Self-knowledge.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 96 (1): 91-116.
    • Argues that we have entitlements to beliefs about our own mental states.
  • Burge, T. (2003). “Perceptual Entitlement.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 67 (3): 503-548.
    • Provides a teleological account of perceptual entitlements as grounded in the anti-individualistic nature of perception.
  • Burge, T. (2005). “Disjunctivism and Perceptual Psychology.” Philosophical Topics, 33 (1): 1-78.
    • Argues against the view of perception called Disjunctivism on the grounds that it conflicts with established psychological theories of vision.
  • Burge T. (2007). Foundations of Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A collection of Burge’s papers in philosophy of mind on anti-individualism.
  • Burge, T. (2007a). “Cartesian Error and the Objectivity of Perception.” in Burge (2007).
    • Defends the claim that our perceptual states are anti-individualistically individuated and introduces his famous Crack-Shadow thought experiment.
  • Casullo, A. (2009). “What is Entitlement?” Acta Analytica, 22: 267-279.
    • Provides a detailed overview and critique of Burge’s proposed distinction between entitlement and justification.
  • Chisholm, R. (1977). Theory of Knowledge. (2nd edition) Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
    • Defends a deontological conception of knowledge and justification.
  • Cohen, S. (2002). “Basic Knowledge and the Problem of Easy Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 65 (2): 309-329.
    • Denies the existence of basic knowledge (knowledge obtained from a source prior to one’s knowing that that source is reliable) through considerations involving closure and bootstrapping.
  • Comesaña, J. (2002). “The Diagonal and the Demon.” Philosophical Studies, 110: 249-266.
    • Advances a new version of reliabilism called Indexical Reliabilism, then argues it circumvents the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Conee, E and Feldman, R. (1985). “Evidentialism.” Philosophical Studies, 48: 15-34.
    • Defends evidentialism in epistemology, the view that the justification of one’s belief is determined by the strength of one’s evidence for that belief.
  • Davidson, D. (1986). “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge.” in E. Lepore (ed.) Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. Blackwell Publishing.
    • Argues for coherentism about truth and knowledge.
  • Davies, M. (2004). “Epistemic Entitlement, Warrant Transmission and Easy Knowledge.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Issue 78 (1): 213-245.
    • Critically discusses Crispin Wright’s views on entitlement, and advances the idea of a negative entitlement not to doubt cornerstone propositions.
  • Dretske, F. (2000). “Entitlement: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60 (3): 591-606.
    • Argues for the existence of epistemic entitlements as grounded in the immediacy and irresistibility of various beliefs and motivated by the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Dretske, F. (2005). “The Case Against Closure.” in M. Steup and E. Sosa (eds.) Contemporary Debates in Epistemology. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
    • Rejects closure by first assuming skepticism is false, and secondly by arguing for the disjunction that either closure is false or skepticism is true.
  • Evans, G. (1982). The Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Proposes a theory of demonstrative thought in this seminal work, and introduces the notion of nonconceptual content.
  • Fernandez. M. (2006). “Troubles with Peacocke’s Rationalism.” Critica, 38 (112): 81-103.
    • Critically discusses Christopher Peacocke’s (2004) book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Ginet, C. (1975). Knowledge, Perception, and Memory. Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
    • Argues for a strong version of internalism, according to which all of the facts that make a subject’s beliefs justified are directly recognizable by the subject upon reflection.
  • Goldman, A. (1986). Epistemology and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Makes a case for epistemology to draw upon the findings in cognitive science.
  • Goldman. A. (1988). “Strong and Weak Justification.” Philosophical Perspectives, 2: 51-69.
    • Advances a modified version of reliabilism that places a distinction between the concepts of strong justification and weak justification.
  • Heck, R. (2007). "Are There Different Kinds of Content?" in B. McLaughlin and J. Cohen (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Mind. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
    • Argues for the existence of nonconceptual content based on the implausibility of perceptual content, satisfying Gareth Evans’ generality constraint on thought.
  • Henderson, D. and Horgan, T. (2007). “Some Ins and Outs of Transglobal Reliabilism.” in S. Goldberg (ed.), Internalism and Externalism in Semantics and Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Advances a new version of reliabilism called transglobal reliabilism, according to which the reliability of a belief process is evaluated relative to the set of experientially possible global environments.
  • Janvid, M. (2009). “The Value of Lesser Goods: The Epistemic Value of Entitlement.”  Acta Analytica, 24: 263-274.
    • Compares the epistemic value of entitlement with that of justification, and criticizes both Burgean and Dretskean entitlement.
  • Jenkins, C. (2007). “Entitlement and Rationality.” Synthese, 157: 25-45.
    • Challenges Crispin Wright’s entitlement of cognitive project, arguing that such entitlement to accept a proposition cannot be construed as epistemically rational.
  • Lehrer, K and Cohen, S. (1983). “Justification, Truth, and Coherence.” Synthese, 55: 191-207.
    • Challenges the time-honored connection between justification and truth by introducing what is nowadays commonly referred to as the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Lycan, W. (1988). Judgement and Justification. Cambridge, MA: Cambridge University Press.
    • Defends a version of epistemological explanationism as a theory of justification.
  • Majors, B. (2005). “The New Rationalism.” Philosophical Papers, 34 (2): 289-305.
    • A critical discussion of Christopher Peacocke’s (2004) book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Majors, B and Sawyer, S. (2005). “The Epistemological Argument for Content Externalism.” Philosophical Perspectives, 19: 257-280.
    • Argues that that the only epistemological view that can adequately account for the constitutive relation between justification and truth is one that involves a commitment to content externalism.
  • Millikan, R. (1984). Language, Thought and Other Biological Categories. Cambridge, MA: MIT press.
    • Develops a naturalistic account of language and thought, wherein the meaning associated with sentences and the intentionality associated with thoughts are to be explicated in terms of how sentences and thoughts properly function.
  • Peacocke, C. (1992). A Study of Concepts. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Proposes a theory of concepts in which concepts are individuated by their possession conditions, and also introduces the notions of ‘scenario content’ and ‘protoproposition’ as they apply to perceptual content.
  • Peacocke, C. (2001). "Does Perception have a Nonconceptual Content?" Journal of Philosophy, 98: 609-615.
    • Defends the claim that perception has nonconceptual content, and wards off criticisms from John McDowell and Bill Brewer.
  • Peacocke, C. (2004). The Realm of Reason. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Develops a rationalist picture of epistemic entitlement according to which we have entitlements to our perceptual beliefs, a priori beliefs, beliefs based on inductive inference, beliefs about our own actions, and moral beliefs.
  • Pryor, J. (2000). "The Skeptic and the Dogmatist." Nous, 34: 517-49.
    • Defends dogmatism, a modest foundationalist view according to which an experience as of p’s being the case provides one with a prima facie justification to believe that p, without requiring that one have independent reason to believe one is not in a skeptical scenario.
  • Pryor, J. (2001). “Recent Highlights of Epistemology.” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 52: 95-124.
    • Canvases a host of popular topics in contemporary epistemology, including contextualism, modest foundationalism, the internalism/externalism debate, and the ethics of belief.
  • Pryor, J. (2004). “What’s wrong with Moore’s Argument?” Philosophical Issues, 14: 349-378.
    • Defends the Moorean response to skepticism.
  • Putnam, H. (2000). “Brains in a Vat.” in S. Bernecker and F. Dretske (eds.), Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology. Oxford University Press.
    • Appeals to externalist accounts of meaning to argue that the statement, “I am a brain in a vat,” is self-defeating, and so cannot be true.
  • Sellars, W. (1963). Science, Perception and Reality. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Famously argues against the “Myth of the Given” and develops a broadly coherentist epistemology.
  • Stroud, B. (1977). Hume. New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Offers a detailed overview of Hume’s philosophy, including the Problem of Induction.
  • Wedgwood, R. (2007). “Christopher Peacocke’s The Realm of Reason.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 74 (3): 776-791.
    • Critically discusses Christopher Peacocke’s book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Williams, M. (2000). “Dretske on Epistemic Entitlement.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60 (3): 607-612.
    • Critically discusses Fred Dretske’s (2000) paper, “Entitlement: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?”
  • Wright, C. (2003). “Some Reflections on the Acquisition of Warrant by Inference” in S. Nuccetelli (ed.), New Essays on Semantic Externalism, Skepticism and Self-Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Explains the difference between a cogent argument and an argument in which the premises fails to transmit their warrants to the conclusion.
  • Wright, C. (2004). “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 78 (1):167–212.
    • Develops the notion of unearned entitlements for cornerstone propositions, and explores the prospects and limitations on strategic entitlement, entitlement of cognitive project, entitlement of rational deliberation, and entitlement of substance.
  • Wright, C. (2007). “The Perils of Dogmatism.” in S. Nuccetelli and G. Seay (eds.), Themes from G. E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Presents a series of problems for dogmatist accounts of justification.


Author Information

Jon Altschul
Loyola University-New Orleans
U. S. A.

The Theory-Theory of Concepts

The Theory-Theory of concepts is a view of how concepts are structured, acquired, and deployed. Concepts, as they will be understood here, are mental representations that are implicated in many of our higher thought processes, including various forms of reasoning and inference, categorization, planning and decision making, and constructing and testing explanations. The view states that concepts are organized within and around theories, that acquiring a concept involves learning such a theory, and that deploying a concept in a cognitive task involves theoretical reasoning, especially of a causal-explanatory sort.

The term “Theory-Theory” derives from Adam Morton (1980), who proposed that our everyday understanding of human psychology constitutes a kind of theory by which we try to predict and explain behavior in terms of its causation by beliefs, intentions, emotions, traits of character, and so on. The idea that psychological knowledge and understanding might be explained as theory possession also derives from Premack & Woodruff’s famous 1978 article, “Does the Chimpanzee Have a Theory of Mind?” A Theory-Theory in general is thus a proposal to explain a certain psychological capacity in terms of a tacit or explicit internally represented theory of a domain. The Theory-Theory of concepts, however, goes beyond the mere claim that we possess such theories, saying in addition that some or all of our concepts are constituted by their essential connections with these theories.

The origins of the Theory-Theory involve several converging lines of investigation. First, it arose as part of a general critique of the formerly dominant prototype theory of concepts; second, it was an empirically-motivated response to the shortcomings of the developmental theories of Piaget and Vygotsky; and third, it involved applying ideas from Kuhn’s philosophy of science to explain phenomena having to do with the development of cognition in individuals. While the theory has often been vaguely formulated, due in large part to the open-endedness inherent in the central notion of a theory, there are substantial bodies of empirical evidence that underlie the main tenets of the view. In particular, the Theory-Theory has been responsible for largely displacing the notion that cognitive development starts from a simple base of perceptual primitives grouped together by similarity. Rather, it is guided by domain-specific explanatory expectations at many stages, and these expectations can be seen to function in adult reasoning and categorization as well. While strong versions of the Theory-Theory have been subject to numerous objections, these contributions endure and continue to shape what many scholars claim are the best existing models of higher cognition.

Table of Contents

  1. Background
  2. The Theory-Theory
    1. Origins of the View
    2. Theories Defined
    3. Concepts in Theories Versus Concepts as Theories
  3. Support for the Theory-Theory
    1. Cognitive Development
    2. Adult Categorization, Inference, and Learning
  4. Relations to Other Views
    1. Relations to Essentialism
    2. Relations to Causal Modeling Approaches
  5. Objections to the Theory-Theory
    1. Holism
    2. Compositionality
    3. Scope
  6. Disanalogies Between Development and Science
  7. Conclusions
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Background

The Theory-Theory emerged in part as a reaction to existing trends in the psychology of concepts and categorization, which during the late 1970’s was dominated by the prototype theory of concepts. Exemplar models were also being developed during this time, but the prototype theory encapsulated many of the views which were the foils against which the Theory-Theory developed its main assumptions.

Prototype theory derives in large part from the work of Eleanor Rosch and her collaborators (Rosch, 1977; Rosch & Mervis, 1975; see Smith & Medin, 1981 for historical perspective and Hampton, 1995 for a canonical statement of the view). These theories assume that concepts represent statistical information about the categories that they pick out. The concept tree represents the properties that people take to be typical of trees: they have bark, they can grow to be relatively tall, they have green leaves that may change color, they have a certain silhouette, birds often nest in them, they grow potentially edible fruits, and so on. These comprise the tree prototype (or stereotype).

This stereotype is acquired by a process of abstraction from examples: individual trees are perceptually salient parts of the environment, and by repeated perception of such category instances, one gradually forms a summary representation that ‘averages’ the qualities of the trees one has observed. This summary is often represented as a list of features that belong to category members. Properties that are more frequently perceived in the instances will be assigned a greater feature weight in the prototype. This process of concept acquisition is often portrayed as a passive one.

Finally, novel objects are categorized as falling under a prototype concept in virtue of their similarity to the prototype—that is, by how many features they share with it (weighted by those features’ importance). Similarity computations also explain other phenomena, such as the fact that some objects are better examples of a category than others (flamingos and penguins are atypical birds since they lack most of the prototypical bird features).

The prototype theory has several characteristics which made it a fitting target for Theory theorists. First, it suggests that concepts have a basically superficial nature. Often, though not invariably, features in prototypes were assumed to be readily perceivable. Prototype theory was thus affiliated with a certain empiricist bent. This was reinforced by the fact that prototypes are acquired by a simple statistical-associative process akin to that assumed by classical empiricists. Second, prototype theory involved a relatively impoverished account of conceptual development and deployment. Concepts passively adjust themselves to new stimuli, and these stimuli activate stored concepts in virtue of their resemblances, but there is little role for active revision or reflective deployment of these concepts. In the wake of the anti-empiricist backlash that gave rise to contemporary cognitive science, particularly in cognitive-developmental psychology, these assumptions were ripe for questioning.

2. The Theory-Theory

a. Origins of the View

The Theory-Theory itself has a somewhat complicated origin story, with roots in a number of philosophical and psychological doctrines. One is the reaction against stage theories of cognitive development, particularly Piagetian and Vygotskian theories. Stage theories propose that children’s cognitive development follows a rigid and universal script, with a fixed order of transitions from one qualitatively distinct form of thought to another taking place across all domains on the same schedule. Each stage is characterized by a distinctive set of representations and processes. In Piaget’s theory, children move through sensorimotor, preoperational, concrete operational, and formal operational stages from birth to roughly 11 or 12 years old. Similarly, Vygotsky held that children move from a stage of representing categories in terms of sensory images of individual objects, through a stage of creating representations of objectively unified categories, and finally a stage of categories arranged around abstract, logical relationships.

While Piaget and Vygotsky’s stage theories differ, both hold that early childhood thought is characterized by representation of categories in terms of their perceivable properties and the inability to reason abstractly (causally or logically) about these categories. Early childhood cognition, in short, involves being perceptually bound. While the empirical basis and explanatory structure of these theories had been challenged before (see R. Gelman & Baillargeon, 1983 and Wellman & Gelman, 1988 for review), Theory theorists such as Carey (1985), Gopnik (1988, 1996), Gopnik & Meltzoff (1997), and Keil (1989) went beyond providing disconfirming evidence and began to lay out an alternative positive vision of how cognitive development proceeds.

A second root of the Theory-Theory derives from philosophy of science, particularly from Kuhn’s account of theory change and scientific revolutions. Kuhn’s view is too complex to summarize here, but two aspects of it have been particularly influential in developmental psychology.

One is Kuhn’s notion that theory change in science involves periods of ‘normal science’, during which a mature theory is applied successfully to a range of phenomena, and periods of ‘paradigm shifting’. A paradigm shift occurs when counterevidence to a theory has built up beyond a certain threshold and it can no longer be adequately modified in response, consistent with its not becoming intolerably ad hoc. In paradigm shifts, new explanatory notions and models take center stage, and old ones may be pushed to the margins or adopt new roles. New practices and styles of experimentation become central. These changes are relatively discontinuous compared with the usual gradual accumulation of changes and modifications characteristic of science.

A second, connected with this notion of a paradigm shift, is the Kuhnian doctrine of incommensurability. This is the idea that when new theories are constructed, the central explanatory concepts of the old theory often change their meaning, so that a claim made before and after a paradigm shift, even if it uses the same words, may not express the same proposition, since those words now express different concepts. The concept of mass, as it existed in pre-relativistic physics, no longer means the same thing—indeed, we now need to distinguish between uses of ‘mass’ that pick out rest mass and those that pick out relativistic mass. Often this involves creating new concepts that cannot be captured in the conceptual vocabulary of the old theory, differentiating two concepts that were previously conflated, or coalescing two previously distinct concepts into one. In all of these cases, the expressive vocabulary of the new conceptual scheme is not equivalent to that of the old scheme. Theory theorists have often adopted both the Kuhnian claim about paradigm shifts as a model for understanding certain phenomena in development, and the associated claim of semantic or conceptual incommensurability (Carey, 1991).

A third root involves what Keil (1989) dubs the rejection of ‘Original Sim’. Original Sim is roughly the view of category structure and learning suggested by prototype theory, particular  an empiricist one. This view is most clearly defended by Quine (1977), who proposes that children begin life with an innate similarity space that is governed by perceptual information, and over time begin to develop theoretical structures that supersede these initial groupings. On this empiricist perspective, children’s first concepts should be bundles of perceptual features, typically consisting of intrinsic rather than relational properties, and categorization should be simply a matter of matching the perceived features of a novel object to those of the concept. Inductive inferences concerning a category are within reach so long as they are confined to these observable properties, and objects share inductive potential to the extent that they are similar to the perceptual prototype. Moreover, these perceptual prototypes are assumed to be acquired by statistical tabulation of observed co-occurrences in the world, in a relatively theory-free way; seeing that certain furry quadrupeds meow is sufficient for constructing a cat concept that encodes these properties. It is only at later stages of development that concepts reflect understanding of the hidden structure of categories, and come to enable inductions that go beyond such similarities.

Fourth, Theory-Theory is often motivated by the hypothesis that certain concepts (or categories) have a kind of coherence that makes them seem especially non-arbitrary (Murphy & Medin, 1985; Medin & Wattenmaker, 1987). The categories of diamonds, sports cars, or otters seem to be relatively ‘coherent’ in the sense that their members bear interesting and potentially explainable relations to one another: diamonds are made of carbon atoms whose organization explains their observable properties, otters share a common ancestry and genetic-developmental trajectory that explain their phenotype and behavior, and so forth. On the other hand, the category of things on the left side of my desk, or things within 100 feet of the Eiffel Tower, or things that are either electrons or clown wigs, do not. They are simply arbitrary collections.

Feature-based theories of concepts, such as prototype theory, seem to have particular difficulty explaining the phenomenon of coherence, since they are inherently unconstrained and allow any set of properties to be lumped together to form a category, whereas our concepts often appear to represent categories as involving more than merely sets of ad hoc co-instantiated properties. They include relations among these properties, as well as explanatory connections of various sorts. We don’t merely think of sports cars as expensive artifacts with four wheels, big engines, a sleek shape, and bright coloration, which make a loud noise as they roar past at high speed. These features are explanatorily connected in various ways: their shape and engine size contribute to their speed, their engines explain their noisiness, their speed and attractive appearance explain their costliness, and so on. Insofar as these explanatory relations among properties are represented, concepts themselves are more coherent, reflecting our implicit belief in the worldly coherence of their categories. Theories are the conceptual glue that makes many of our everyday and scientific concepts coherent, and models of concepts that fail to accord theories an important role are missing an account of a crucial phenomenon (however, see Margolis, 1999 for detailed criticism of this notion).

From this survey, it should be clear that the development of Theory theories of concepts has been driven by a host of different motivations and pressures. Hence there exist many flavors of the view, each with its own distinctive formulation, concerns, and central phenomena. However, despite the fact that the view lacks a canonical statement, it possesses a set of family resemblances that make it an interesting source of predictions and a robust framework for empirical research, as well as a unified target of criticism.

b. Theories Defined

The first essential posit of these views is the notion of a mentally represented theory. Theories are bodies of information (or, as psychologists and linguists sometimes say, bodies of knowledge) about a particular domain. Such theories have been posited to explain numerous psychological capacities: linguistic competence results from a theory of the grammar of English or Urdu; mental state attribution results from a theory of mind; even visual perception results from a theory of how 3-D objects in space behave in relation to the observer. But theories are not just any body of information held in memory. What makes theories distinctive or special? Keil (1989, p. 279) called this “the single most important problem for future research” in the Theory-Theory tradition.

Gopnik & Meltzoff (1997, pp. 32-41) give what is probably the most comprehensive set of conditions on theories. These conditions fall into three categories: structural, functional, and dynamic. Structurally, theories are abstract, coherent, causally organized, and ontologically committed bodies of information. They are abstract in that they posit entities and laws using a vocabulary that differs from the vocabulary used to state the evidence that supports them. They are coherent in that there are systematic relations between the entities posited by the theory and the evidence. Theories are causal insofar as the structure that they posit in the world to explain observable regularities is ordinarily a causal one. Finally, they are ontologically committed if the entities that they posit correspond to real kinds, and also support counterfactuals about how things would be under various non-actual circumstances. Some of these conditions are also advanced by Keil (1989, p. 280), who proposes that causal relations are central to theories, especially where they are homeostatic and hierarchically organized.

Functionally, theories must make predictions, interpret evidence in new ways, and provide explanations of phenomena in their domain. The predictions of theories go beyond simple generalizations of the evidence, and include ranges of phenomena that the theory was not initially developed to cover. Theories interpret evidence by providing new descriptions that influence what is seen as relevant or salient and what is not. And crucially, theories provide explanations of phenomena, understood as an abstract, coherent causal account of how the phenomena are produced and sustained. Theories are essentially related to the phenomena that make up their domain; hence in Keil’s developed view, there is a key role for associative relations in providing the raw data for theoretical development as well as a ‘fallback’ for when theories run out (Keil, 1989, p. 281).

Last, theories are not static representations, but have dynamic properties. This follows from the fact that they develop in response to, and may gain in credibility or be defeated by, the empirical evidence. The sorts of dynamic properties that characterize theories include: an initial period involving the accumulation of evidence via processes of experimentation and observation, the discovery of counterevidence, the possible discounting of such evidence as noise, the generation of ad hoc hypotheses to amend a theory, the production of a new theory when an old one has accumulated too much contrary evidence or too many ugly and complicated auxiliary amendments.

c. Concepts in Theories Versus Concepts as Theories

Once the central explanatory construct of a mental theory is clear, two varieties of the Theory-Theory need to be distinguished. These views differ on the nature of the relationship between concepts and theories.

On the concepts in theories view, concepts are the constituents of theories. Theories are understood as something like bodies of beliefs or other propositional representations, and these beliefs have concepts as their constituents. The belief that electrons are negatively charged is part of our theory of electrons, and that belief contains the concept electron as a part (as well as has negative charge). The set of electron, involving beliefs that meet the sorts of constraints laid out in section 2b, constitute one’s theory of electrons. These beliefs describe the sorts of things electrons are, how they can be expected to behave, how they are detected, how they relate to other fundamental physical entities, how they can be exploited for practical purposes, and so on. For the concepts in theories view, concepts function much like theoretical terms.

On the concepts as theories view, on the other hand, the constituency relations run the opposite direction. Concepts themselves are identified with miniature theories of a particular domain. For instance, Keil (1989, p. 281) proposes that “[m]ost concepts are partial theories themselves in that they embody explanations of the relations between their constituents, of their origins, and of their relations to other clusters of features.” So the concept electron would itself be made up of various theoretical postulates concerning electrons, their relationship to other particles, their causal propensities which explain phenomena in various domains of physics, and so on. Concepts are not terms in theories, they are themselves theories.

As stated, the concepts in theories view is scarcely controversial. If people possess mentally represented theories at all, then those theories are composed of beliefs and concepts, and so at least some of our concepts are embedded in theory-like knowledge structures. Call this the weak concepts in theories view. A strong concepts in theories view, on the other hand, says that not only are concepts embedded in theories, but they are also individuated by those theories. Carey (1985, p. 198) seems to hold this view: “Concepts must be identified by the roles they play in theories.” This is just to say that what makes them the very concepts that they are is their relationships (inferential, associative, causal, explanatory, and so forth.) with the other concepts and beliefs in the theory. There are many ways of carving out different notions of inferential or theoretically significant roles for concepts to play, but on all of them, concepts are constituted by their relations to other concepts and to the evidence that governs their conditions of application.

A consequence seems to be that if those relationships change, or if the theory itself changes in certain respects, then the concepts change as well. The change from a view on which atoms are the smallest, indivisible elements of matter to one on which atoms are made up of more fundamental particles might represent a sufficiently central and important change that the concept atom itself is no longer the same after such a transition takes place; similarly, perhaps the victory of anti-vitalism entailed a change in the concept life from being essentially linked with a particular irreducible vital force to being decoupled from such commitments. Notice that this consequence also applies to the concepts as theories view. If a concept is identified with a theory (rather than being merely embedded in it), it seems as if, prima facie, any change to the theory is a change to the concept.

The concepts as theories view poses separate difficulties of its own. On this view, concepts are extremely complex data structures composed of some sort of theoretical principles, laws, generalizations, explanatory connections, and so on. What status do these have? A natural suggestion is to regard all of these as being beliefs. But this view is straightforwardly incompatible with a view on which concepts are the constituents of beliefs and other higher thoughts. It is mereologically impossible both for concepts both be identified with terms in theories and with theories themselves. We would need some other way of talking about the representations that make up beliefs if we choose to regard concepts as simply being miniature theories.

Despite the differences between these two views, the empirical evidence taken to support the Theory-Theory does not generally discriminate between them, nor have psychologists always been careful to mark these distinctions. As with many debates over representational posits, the views in question generate differing predictions only in combination with supplementary assumptions about cognitive processing and resources. However, there may be theoretical reasons for preferring one view over the other; these will be discussed further in section 5.

3. Support for the Theory-Theory

a. Cognitive Development

Much of the support for the Theory-Theory comes from developmental studies. Carey (1985) largely initiated this line of research with her investigations of children’s concepts of animal, living thing, and kindred biological notions. For example, she found that major changes occur in children’s knowledge of bodies and their functioning from four to eleven years old. The youngest children understand eating, breathing, digesting, and so forth, mainly as human behaviors, and they explain them in terms of human needs, desires, plans, and conventions. Over time, children build various new accounts of bodies, initially treating them as simple containers and finally differentiating them into separate organs that have their own biological functions. In Carey’s terms, young children start out seeing behavior as governed by an intuitive psychological theory, out of which an intuitive biology develops (1985, p. 69).

The centrality of humans to young children’s understanding of living things can be seen in several studies. Four and five year olds are reluctant to attribute animal properties—even eating and breathing—to living beings other than humans. When asked to name things that have various properties of living things, children overwhelmingly pick ‘people’ first, followed by mammals, and then a few other scattered types of creatures. The primacy of people in biology carries over to judgments of similarity, with adults displaying a smooth gradient of similarity between people and other living things and six year olds seeing a sharp dividing line between people and the rest of the animal kingdom, including mammals. Finally, in inductive projection tasks people are clearly paradigmatic for four year olds: if told that a person has an organ called a spleen, they will project having a spleen to dogs and bees, but rarely the opposite. By age 10, people are seen as no longer unique in this respect. So young children’s theory of life is focused initially around humans as the paradigm exemplars, and only later becomes generalized as they discover commonalities among all animals and other living things. Indeed, the very concept living thing comes to be acquired as this knowledge develops.

Keil (1989) added to the evidence with many striking results concerning how children’s concepts of natural kinds, nominal kinds, and artifacts develop from kindergarten onwards. He finds compelling evidence for what he initially called a ‘characteristic-to-defining’ shift in conceptual structure. Characteristic features are akin to prototypes: compilations of statistically significant but possibly superficial properties found in categories. Defining features, on the other hand, are those that genuinely make something the kind of thing that it is, regardless of how well it corresponds to the observed characteristics.

In a series of discovery studies, Keil (1989) gave children descriptions of objects that have the characteristic features belonging to a natural kind, but which were later discovered to have the (plausible) defining features of a different kind; for example, an animal that looks and acts like a horse but which is discovered to have the inside parts of cows as well as cow parents and cow babies. While at age five, children thought these things were horses, by age seven they were more likely to think them cows, and adults were nearly certain these were cows. Defining features based on biology (internal structure, parentage) come to dominate characteristic features (appearance, behavior).

In a related series of transformation studies, children heard about a member of a natural kind which underwent some sort of artificial alterations to its appearance, behavior, and insides; for example, a raccoon that was dyed to look like a skunk and operated on so that it produces a foul, skunk-like odor. Five-year olds thought these transformations changed the raccoon into a skunk, while seven year olds were more resistant, and nine year olds were nearly sure that such changes in kind weren’t possible. This effect was notably stronger for biological kinds than mineral kinds; however, children at all ages strongly resisted the idea that a member of a biological kind could be turned into something from a different ontological category (for example, an animal cannot be turned into a plant). Finally, some kinds of transformations are more likely to change a thing’s kind: among five year olds, alterations to internal or developmental features along with permanent surface parts are more effective than temporary surface changes or costumes, and internal changes retain their influence until at least age nine.

In Keil’s view, this shows that children may start out with a comparatively impoverished theory of what makes something a member of a biological kind (or a mineral kind, social kind, or artifact kind), but this theory is enriched and deepened with more causal principles governing origins, growth, internal structure, reproduction, nutrition, and behavior. As this network of causal principles becomes more enriched they recognize that the category members are defined by the presence of these theoretically significant linkages rather than by the more superficial features that initially guided them. ‘Primal theories’ develop into more mature folk theories in different domains according to their own time course.

Finally, Gopnik & Meltzoff (1997) survey a range of domains to argue for the early emergence of theories. To take one example, they argue that children’s understanding of objects and object appearances starts off as highly theoretical and develops in response to new experience until they achieve adult form. Six-month olds, for instance, fail to search for objects that are hidden behind screens, and they show no surprise when an object moves behind a screen, fails to appear at a gap in the middle of the screen, but then appears whole from behind the other side of the screen. These behaviors only emerge at 9 months. Gopnik & Meltzoff explain this change by claiming that the infants come to understand that occlusion makes objects invisible. Until 12 months, however, they continue to make the ‘A-not-B’ error, which involves searching for an object under the first occluder it disappeared behind, rather than the last one. They ascribe this failure to children’s adherence to an auxiliary hypothesis of the form: objects will be where they appeared before. This rule is abandoned when it comes to conflict with the evidence and the child’s developing theory of object behavior. In addition, from ages 12 to 18 months, children begin to systematically play (‘experiment’) with hiding and invisible displacement, suggesting that they are interested in generating evidence about this developing cognitive domain. This in turn strengthens the analogy between cognitive development and active theorizing by adult scientists.

b. Adult Categorization, Inference, and Learning

Murphy & Medin (1985) argued in largely abstract fashion that categorization should be seen as a process of explaining why an exemplar belongs with the rest of a category. A man who jumps into a swimming pool while fully clothed at a party is plausibly drunk, even though these are not features of drunks in general—or they certainly are not stored as such in one’s default drunk concept. Theories and explanatory knowledge are required to focus on the relevant features of categories in a variety of tasks and contexts. Research with adults has tended to support this perspective.

One significant piece of evidence that comports with the general Theory-Theory perspective is the causal status effect (Ahn & Kim, 2000). The effect is the tendency of participants to privilege causally deeper or more central properties in a range of tasks including categorization and similarity judgment. For example, if people are taught about a person who has a cough caused by a certain kind of virus, and then given two other descriptions, one which matches in the cause (same virus) but not the effect (runny nose), and another that matches in the effect (cough) but not the cause (different virus), common causal features make exemplars more similar. Matching causal features can even override other shared features in categorization. If taught about an example with a cause that produces two effect features and two other examples, one of which shares the cause only and the other of which shares both effects, a majority of participants group the common cause exemplar with the original, even though they differ in most features.

Murphy (2002) reviews an extensive body of evidence showing that background knowledge has a pervasive effect on category learning, categorization, and induction. To take two examples, consider artificial category learning and category construction. In learning studies, participants are given two categories that are distinguished by different lists of features. The features that describe a more ‘coherent’ category in which the features are very plausibly related to each other (for example, ‘Made in Norway, heavily insulated, white, drives on glaciers, has treads’) were played against those that describe a more ‘neutral’ category. Participants found the coherent categories much easier to learn, and retained more information about them. Similarly, if given the ability to freely sort these items into categories they tended to group the coherent category members together even when they shared only a single feature. Background knowledge concerning the likely relationships among these features plays an essential role in learning and categorizing, even when it is not explicitly brought up in the experiment itself. This further undermines the prototype theory’s account of learning as a process of atheoretical tabulation of correlations.

4. Relations to Other Views

a. Relations to Essentialism

The Theory-Theory is closely related to psychological essentialism (henceforth just ‘essentialism’), the claim that people tend to represent categories as if they possessed hidden, non-obvious properties that make them the sorts of things that they are and that causally produce or constrain their observable properties (Medin & Ortony, 1989). These essences need not be actually known, but may be believed to exist even in the absence of detailed information about them. Concepts may include either conjectures as to what their essential properties might be, or else blank ‘essence placeholders’ that govern in the absence of these as-yet-unknown essential properties. Commitment to essences may be viewed as a kind of theoretical commitment, insofar as essences are causally potent but unobserved properties that structure and explain observable properties of categories. More generally, it is the commitment to there being a certain kind of causal structure underlying the categories we commonly represent.

There is a large body of evidence that supports the psychological essentialist hypothesis (Gelman, 2003, 2004; see Strevens, 2000 for criticism). For example, children’s inductions are governed by more than superficial resemblances among objects. In a standard inductive projection paradigm, participants are presented with a triad of pictures of objects only two of which perceptually resemble each other (for example, a leaf, a leaf-shaped insect, and a small black insect) and two of which share a verbal label (for example, both insects, while dissimilar, are called ‘bugs’, and the leaf is called a ‘leaf’). They are then told that one object of the resembling pair has a certain property and asked to project the property to the third object. By 30 months, children will project properties on the basis of labeled category membership rather than similarity. This effect does not depend on the precise repetition of the verbal label (that is, synonyms work just as well), and it tends to be more powerful in natural biological kinds than in artifacts. Even among 16- to 21-month olds one can find similar effects: behaviors displayed with one sort of toy animal (barking, chewing on a bone, and so forth.) will be imitated with a perceptually dissimilar animal if they are given a matching label. This suggests that induction is not entirely governed by superficial properties even among very young children.

Children may entertain more specific hypotheses about what the underlying category essences are as well. In Keil’s transformation studies, some participants, when debriefed, maintained that parentage was important to determining kind membership. In a number of studies, Gelman and her collaborators (see, for example, Gelman & Wellman, 1991) have shown that among four to five year olds, insides have a special theoretical role to play. Children can distinguish similar-appearing objects (pigs and piggy banks) from those that have similar insides, and they judge that removing a creature’s insides both removes its category-typical behaviors and also makes it no longer the same kind of thing. Removing outsides or changing a transitory property has little effect on membership or function.

These studies provide further evidence that the Original Sim has at best a weak grip on young children. Moreover, they reinforce the claim that categorization can sometimes be dominated by an early-emerging understanding of biology that treats stereotypical properties as non-dispositive. Gelman’s own robust psychological essentialism includes further claims such as that category boundaries are invariably taken to be sharp rather than fuzzy, and that essences invariably focus on purely internal properties. Whatever the status of these additional claims, the broader moral of the essentialism literature is in line with the proposals made by Theory theorists. Children come prepared to learn about deeper causal relations in many domains and they readily treat these relations as important in categorizing and making inductions.

b. Relations to Causal Modeling Approaches

In recent years much attention has focused on the role of causality in cognition, and consequently theories of cognitive performance that emphasize causal modeling have gained prominence. The idea that concepts might be identified (at least in part) with causal models has grown out of this tradition.

The theory of causal models is a formally well-developed and quantitatively precise way of describing probabilistic and causal dependency information, particularly in graphical form (for accessible introductions, see Gopnik & Shulz, 2007; Glymour, 2001; Sloman, 2005). Briefly, a causal model of a category depicts part of the relevant causal information about how things in the domain are produced, organized, and function. A causal model of a bird notes that it has wings, a body, and feathers, but also encodes the fact that those features causally contribute to its being able to fly; a causal model of a car depicts the fact that it is drivable in virtue of having wheels and an engine, that it can transport people because it is drivable, and that it makes noise because of its engine. These structures can be represented as sets of features connected by arrows, which indicate when the presence of one property causes or sustains (and therefore makes more probable) the presence of another. These directed causal graphs provide one possible representational format for concepts.

For example, Chaigneau, Barsalou, & Sloman (2004) have proposed the H I P E theory of artifact categorization, which states that artifacts are grouped according to their Historical role, the Intentions of the agents that use them, their Physical structure, and the Events in which they participate. On H I P E, artifact concepts are miniature causal models of the relations among these properties, all of which may potentially contribute to making something the kind of artifact that it is. Similar sorts of models could be developed for natural kind concepts. Indeed, essentialism itself is one form that a causal model can take: the essence is the ‘core’ of the concept, and it causally produces the more superficial features. Causal model theory is a generalization of this idea that allows these graphs to take many different forms.

Causal model theory is best seen as one form that the Theory-Theory can take (Gopnik & Schulz, 2004; Rehder, 2003). It shares that view’s commitment to causal-explanatory structure being central to concepts. While it is tied to a more specific hypothesis about representation than Theory-Theory in general (the formalism of directed causal graphs), this is also a strength, since these models are part of a well-developed framework for learning and processing. Causal model theory gives the Theory-Theory the resources to develop more wide-ranging and detailed empirical predictions concerning categorization, induction, and naming.

It is also worth noting that causal model theory may give the concepts as theories view the resources to answer the mereological objection it faces. The components of causal models can be seen as features representing properties, connected by links representing causal relations. Many models of concepts take them to be complex structures composed of features in this way. If we see causal models as miniature theories, then we can view concepts as theories if we identify them with such models. Adopting this approach eliminates any potential problems about concepts being both the constituents of beliefs and also being composed of beliefs.

5. Objections to the Theory-Theory

a. Holism

The holism objection focuses on the fact that the individuation conditions for concepts are closely tied to those for theories. They are holistic, meaning that a concept’s identity depends on its relations to a large set of other representational states. This position is suggested by Murphy & Medin’s comment that “[i]n order to characterize knowledge about and use of a concept, we must include all of the relations involving that concept and the other concepts that depend on it” (1985, p. 297). This gives rise to problems concerning the stability of concepts. The objection may be put as follows. Suppose concepts are identified by their relation to theories. Then changes in theories entail changes in concepts: if C1,…,Cn are constituted by their relation to T1, and T1 changes into T2, then at least some of C1,…,Cn will have to change as well, so long as the changes in the theories occurs in the parts that contribute to individuating those concepts. And it is part of the developmental and dynamical account of the Theory-Theory that such transitions in theories take place. So according to the Theory-Theory, concepts are unstable; they change over time, so that one does not have the same concepts before a revision in theory that one has afterwards.

The conclusion is particularly objectionable if one assumes that there will be many changes to theories, so that concepts also change frequently. But there are reasons to want concepts to be more stable than this. First, one wants to be able to compare concepts across individuals with different theories. A young child may not have the fully developed life concept, but she and I can still have many common beliefs about particular living things and their behavior, even if she does not represent them as being alive in the way that I do (that is, even if her understanding of life is impoverished relative to mine). Second, the rationality of theory change itself depends on some intertheoretic stability of concepts: Rejecting theory T1 may involve coming to believe that belief B formulated using T1’s concepts is false. So now that I believe T2, I reject B. But if changing from T1 to T2­ involves changing the concepts involved in B, I can no longer even formulate that belief, since I now lack the required conceptual resources. So we are at a loss to describe the rational nature of the transition between theories.

What this suggests is that belief attributions are often stable across theory changes; or at least, not every change in one’s background theory should change many or all of one’s concepts (and hence beliefs). Some sort of independence from belief is required. The problem is that concepts are individuated by their roles, which in turn are determined by the causal, inferential, and evidential roles of the propositions that contain them, and these are precisely what change as theories do (Fodor, 1994; Margolis, 1995).

This problem faces both the strong concepts in theories view and the concepts as theories view, but the weak concepts in theories view is immune to it, since it allows that concepts may participate in theories without being individuated by them. Two responses to the holism objection are typical. First, some Theory theorists (for example, Gopnik & Meltzoff, 1997) have embraced it. It is, they suggest, not implausible that young children are to a certain degree incomprehensible to adults, as would be predicted if their world view is incommensurable with ours (Carey, 2009, p. 378). Second, others have attempted to avoid this conclusion by distinguishing respects in which concepts may change (such as narrow content or internal conceptual role) and respects in which they may remain stable (such as wide content or reference). This dual-factor approach is also adopted by Carey (2009). The unstable respects are those that differ with background theories, while the stable respects provide continuity so that concepts can be identified across changes and differences in view. The success of this approach depends on whether the stable respects can do the relevant explanatory work needed in psychological explanation and communication.

b. Compositionality

A representational system is compositional if the properties of complex symbols are completely determined by the properties of the simpler symbols that make them up, plus the properties of their mode of combination. So predicate logic is compositional, since the semantic value of ‘Fa’ is determined by the semantic values of the predicate ‘F’ and the individual constant ‘a’. Similarly ‘Fa & Fb’ is semantically determined as a function of ‘Fa’, ‘Fb’, and the interpretation of conjunction. Many have argued that thought is compositional as well (Fodor, 1998), which entails that the properties of complex concepts derive wholly from the properties of their constituents.

If thought is compositional, and concepts are the constituents of thoughts, then whatever concepts are must also be compositional. So if concepts are (or are individuated by) theories, then theories must similarly be compositional. However, there are good reasons to think that theories are not compositional. A standard example is the concept of pet fish. The fish might come from the theory of folk biology, while pet might derive from a theory of human social behavior (since keeping pets is a sociocultural fact about humans). If the strong concepts in theories view is right, their content is determined by their inferential role in each of these theories. But pet fish has a novel inferential role that is not obviously predictable from those roles taken individually. Instances of pet fish, for example, are typically thought to live in bowls and feed on flakes, neither of which is true of pets or fish in general. This information is not derived from one’s ‘pet theory’ or ‘fish theory’. It is therefore not compositional. The same point can be made about the concepts as theories view. If one’s causal models of pets and fish do not somehow encode this information in the features that make them up, then it cannot be derived compositionally by putting them together. Since examples like this can be multiplied indefinitely, the Theory-Theory cannot account for the general compositionality of thought.

While many psychologists have simply ignored these concerns, several responses are possible. Here are two. First, one can divide concepts into two components, a stable compositional element and a non-compositional element (Rips, 1995). The compositional element might be thought of just as a simple label, while the non-compositional element includes theoretical and prototypical information. One part has the job of accounting for concept combination, the other has the job of accounting for categorization and inductive inference. Second, one can try to weaken the compositionality requirement. Perhaps concepts are required only to be compositional in principle, not in practice; or else compositionality might be viewed as a fallback strategy to be employed when there is no other information available about the extension of a complex concept (Prinz, 2002; Robbins, 2002). Whichever approach one takes, the compositionality objection highlights the fact that while the Theory-Theory has impressive resources for explaining facts about development and concept deployment, concept combination is more challenging to account for.

c. Scope

The scope objection is one that faces nearly every theory of concepts. In general, where such a theory proposes an identification of the form ‘concepts are K’, where ‘K’ is a kind of mental structure or capacity, the question can be raised: are all concepts like this? Or are there cases where someone might possess the relevant concept but not possess K? For instance, if concepts are prototypes, then there must be the right sort of prototype for every concept we can use in thought. A theory has satisfactory scope if there exists the right sort of K for every concept that we are capable of entertaining.

For the Theory-Theory, the problem seems to be that there are too few theories. We have concepts such as car, computer, gin, lemur, and nightstick. Perhaps for some of these we have theories, at least of a highly sketchy nature. But it is less clear that we have these for other concepts. One might have the concept higgs boson (from reading newspaper articles about the Large Hadron Collider) but have essentially no interesting knowledge of the Standard Model of particle physics. One might have the concept true but not have a theory of truth. One might have the concept billiards but know nothing of the game’s rules or conventions (‘that game they play in the UK that resembles pool’). If the Theory-Theory identifies each concept with a domain-specific theory, these scope challenges are serious. Denying that we have these concepts in virtue of lacking the relevant knowledge is unappealing.

One possible response is to restrict the scope of the Theory-Theory itself. Carey (1985) takes this tack. She does not think that every concept must be associated with a proprietary theory. Rather, concepts are embedded in relatively large scale theories of whole cognitive domains: “there are only a relatively few conceptual structures that embody deep explanatory notions—on the order of a dozen or so in the case of educated nonscientists. These conceptual structures correspond to domains that might be the disciplines in a university: psychology, mechanics, a theory of matter, economics, religion, government, biology, history, and so forth.” (Carey, 1985, p. 201). This approach, favored by other domain theorists, gives this version of the concepts in theories view a slight advantage over the concepts as theories view, since the latter is more clearly vulnerable to the scope objection. A defender of the concepts as theories view might fall back to the position that even very sketchy or minimal understanding of the causal principles at work in a category can count as a theory, as, even in these cases, we meet the minimal concept possession conditions, and our understanding is often equally superficial (Rozenblit & Keil, 2002).

d. Disanalogies Between Development and Science

The Theory-Theory relies heavily on the notion that what children do in constructing their knowledge of the world is quite literally like what scientists do in producing, testing, and revising the theories that constitute scientific knowledge. This implies that there is substantial cognitive continuity across development, so that infants and young children, along with older children and adults, employ the same theory-construction mechanisms that operate on prior theoretical representations plus new evidence to produce revised and, with luck, improved theories.

Many have challenged this picture on the grounds that what children do is not in fact sufficiently similar to what scientists do for them to be seen as instances of the same cognitive or epistemic process. These complaints are summarized by Faucher, Mallon, Nazer, Nichols, Ruby, Stich, & Weinberg (2002). They argue that scientific theory revision is a process that is inseparable from a host of cultural factors. For example, there are norms governing how one ought to gather and weigh evidence, as well as how one should revise one’s beliefs, and these govern the practice of science differently across times and cultures. Moreover, theories are usually socially transmitted (in the classroom, the lab, and in less formal contexts) along with these norms. So in science, society and mind interpenetrate in such a way that individual cognition needs to be receptive to external sources of authority, both with respect to theoretical knowledge and epistemic norms. The simple picture of theory revision as involving only initial theories and evidence should be rejected.

There are at least two possible responses to this anti-individualistic argument. One is to argue that while these social factors play a role in adult science, the essential core of scientific practice remains the adjustment of theories under the influence of evidence. Normative factors can eventually come to help us perform these tasks better or in ways that fit in more productively with the surrounding culture, but the basic mechanism of evidence-based revision must be present in any case. And the evidence suggests that it is operative even before these social factors have an effect. A second response would be to argue that this picture is in fact a correct and welcome revision to the overly simplistic view originally proposed by Theory theorists. We should expect there to be substantial cultural influences on children’s cognition, and some of the cross-cultural studies cited by Faucher et al. provide evidence in favor of this hypothesis. So we should enrich the Theory-Theory view of children’s early cognition, not abandon it entirely.

6. Conclusions

The Theory-Theory consists of many interrelated claims about concept individuation, structure, development, and processing. The claim that development of concepts and domain knowledge in children is driven by causal-explanatory expectations, perhaps of an essentialist sort, has been most extensively investigated. While there are some attempts to explain these data by appeal to empiricist principles (Smith, Jones, & Landau, 1996), the Theory-Theory has strong support here. Studies with adults also suggest that causal information is often important to categorization. The behavior of both adults and children has been characterized using the framework of causal models, enabling Theory theorists to frame their view in a formally precise way. Many of the assumptions that trouble the account, such as the strong concepts in theories view that generates the problems of holism and incommensurability, turn out not to be essential to its empirical success. The greatest problem the view faces may be one of scope, but this challenge is arguably faced by all other theories of concepts currently in contention (Machery, 2009; Weiskopf, 2009). Whether or not a thoroughgoing Theory-Theory perspective is ultimately vindicated, its key insights will have to be incorporated by any future comprehensive theory of concepts.

7. References and Further Reading

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  • Carey, S. (1985). Conceptual Change in Childhood. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Carey, S. (1991). "Knowledge acquisition: enrichment or conceptual change?" In S. Carey & R. Gelman (Eds.), The Epigenesis of Mind (pp. 257-291). Hillsdale, N J: Erlbaum.
  • Carey, S. (2009). The Origin of Concepts. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chaigneau, S.E., Barsalou, L.W., & Sloman, S. (2004). "Assessing the causal structure of function." Journal of Experimental Psychology: General, 133, 601-625.
  • Faucher, L., Mallon, R., Nazer, D., Nichols, S., Ruby, A., Stich, S., & Weinberg, J. (2002). "The baby in the labcoat: Why child development is an inadequate model for understanding the development of science." In P. Carruthers, S. Stich & M. Siegal (Eds.), The Cognitive Basis of Science (pp. 335-362). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Fodor, J. (1994). "Concepts: A potboiler." Cognition, 50, 95-113.
  • Fodor, J. (1998). Concepts. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gelman, R., & Baillargeon, R. (1983). "A review of some Piagetian concepts." In J. H. Flavell and E. Markman (Eds.), Cognitive Development: Vol. 3 (pp. 167-230). New York: Wiley.
  • Gelman, S. (2003). The Essential Child. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gelman, S. (2004). "Psychological essentialism in children." Trends in Cognitive Sciences, 8, 404-409.
  • Gelman, S., & Wellman, H. (1991). "Insides and essences: Early understandings of the nonobvious." Cognition, 38, 213-244.
  • Glymour, C. (2001). The Mind’s Arrows. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Gopnik, A. (1988). "Conceptual and semantic development as theory change." Mind and Language, 3, 197-217.
  • Gopnik, A. (1996). "The scientist as child." Philosophy of Science, 63, 485-514.
  • Gopnik, A., & Meltzoff, A. (1997). Words, Thoughts, and Theories. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Gopnik, A., & Schulz, L. (2004). "Mechanisms of theory-formation in young children." Trends in Cognitive Science, 8, 371-377.
  • Gopnik, A., & Schulz, L. (Eds.) (2007). Causal Learning. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Hampton, J. A. (1995). "Similarity-based categorization: The development of prototype theory." Psychologica Belgica, 35, 103-125.
  • Keil, F. C. (1989). Concepts, Kinds, and Cognitive Development. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Machery, E. (2009). Doing Without Concepts. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Margolis, E. (1995). "What is conceptual glue?" Minds and Machines, 9, 241-255.
  • Margolis, E. (1999). "The significance of the theory analogy in the psychological study of concepts." Mind and Language, 10, 45-71.
  • Medin, D., & Ortony, A. (1989). "Psychological essentialism." In S. Vosniadou & A. Ortony (Eds.), Similarity and Analogical Reasoning (pp. 179-195). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Morton, A. (1980). Frames of Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Murphy, G. (2002). The Big Book of Concepts. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Murphy, G., & Medin, D. (1985). "The role of theories in conceptual coherence." Psychological Review, 92, 289-316
  • Medin, D., & Wattenmaker. (1987). "Category cohesiveness, theories, and cognitive archeology." In U. Neisser (Ed.), Concepts and Conceptual Development (pp. 25-63). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Premack, D., & Woodruff, G. (1978). "Does the chimpanzee have a theory of mind?" Behavioral and Brain Sciences, 1, 515-526.
  • Prinz, J. (2002). Furnishing the Mind. Cambridge: M I T Press.
  • Quine, W. V. (1977). "Natural kinds." In S. Schwartz (Ed.), Naming, Necessity, and Natural Kinds (pp. 155-175). Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Redher, B. (2003). "A causal-model theory of conceptual representation and categorization." Journal of Experimental Psychology: Learning, Memory, and Cognition, 29, 1141-59.
  • Rips, L. (1995). "The current status of research on concept combination." Mind and Language, 10, 72-104.
  • Robbins, P. (2002). "How to blunt the sword of compositionality." Nous, 36, 313-334.
  • Rosch, E. (1977). "Human categorization." In N. Warren (Ed.), Advances in Cross-Cultural Psychology: Vol. 1 (pp. 1-49). London: Academic Press.
  • Rosch, E., & Mervis, C. (1975). "Family resemblances: Studies in the internal structure of categories." Cognitive Psychology, 7, 573-605.
  • Rozenblit, L., & Keil, F. (2002). "The misunderstood limits of folk science: An illusion of explanatory depth." Cognitive Science, 26, 521-562.
  • Sloman, S. (2005). Causal Models. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Smith, E. E., & Medin, D. (1981). Concepts and Categories. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Smith, L., Jones, S., & Landau, B. (1996). "Naming in young children: A dumb attentional mechanism?" Cognition, 60, 143-171.
  • Strevens, M. (2000). "The essentialist aspect of native theories." Cognition, 74, 149-175.
  • Weiskopf, D. (2009). "The plurality of concepts." Synthese, 169, 145-173.
  • Wellman, H., & Gelman, S. (1988). "Cognitive development: Foundational theories of core domains." Annual Review of Psychology, 43, 337-375.

Author Information

Daniel A. Weiskopf
Georgia State University
U. S. A.


Immortality is the indefinite continuation of a person’s existence, even after death. In common parlance, immortality is virtually indistinguishable from afterlife, but philosophically speaking, they are not identical. Afterlife is the continuation of existence after death, regardless of whether or not that continuation is indefinite. Immortality implies a never-ending existence, regardless of whether or not the body dies (as a matter of fact, some hypothetical medical technologies offer the prospect of a bodily immortality, but not an afterlife).

Immortality has been one of mankind’s major concerns, and even though it has been traditionally mainly confined to religious traditions, it is also important to philosophy. Although a wide variety of cultures have believed in some sort of immortality, such beliefs may be reduced to basically three non-exclusive models: (1) the survival of the astral body resembling the physical body; (2) the immortality of the immaterial soul (that is an incorporeal existence); (3) resurrection of the body (or re-embodiment, in case the resurrected person does not keep the same body as at the moment of death). This article examines philosophical arguments for and against the prospect of immortality.

A substantial part of the discussion on immortality touches upon the fundamental question in the philosophy of mind: do souls exist? Dualists believe souls do exist and survive the death of the body; materialists believe mental activity is nothing but cerebral activity and thus death brings the total end of a person’s existence. However, some immortalists believe that, even if immortal souls do not exist, immortality may still be achieved through resurrection.

Discussions on immortality are also intimately related to discussions of personal identity because any account of immortality must address how the dead person could be identical to the original person that once lived. Traditionally, philosophers have considered three main criteria for personal identity: the soul criterion , the body criterion  and the psychological criterion.

Although empirical science has little to offer here, the field of parapsychology has attempted to offer empirical evidence in favor of an afterlife. More recently, secular futurists envision technologies that may suspend death indefinitely (such as Strategies for Engineered Negligible Senescence, and mind uploading), thus offering a prospect for a sort of bodily immortality.

Table of Contents

  1. Semantic Problems
  2. Three Models of Immortality
    1. The Survival of the Astral Body
    2. The Immaterial Soul
    3. The Resurrection of the Body
  3. Pragmatic Arguments for the Belief in Immortality
  4. Plato’s Arguments for Immortality
  5. Dualism
    1. Descartes’ Arguments for Dualism
    2. More Recent Dualist Arguments
    3. Arguments against Dualism
  6. A Brief Digression: Criteria for Personal Identity
    1. The Soul Criterion
    2. The Body Criterion
    3. The Psychological Criterion
    4. The Bundle Theory
  7. Problems with the Resurrection of the Body
  8. Parapsychology
    1. Reincarnation
    2. Mediums and Ghostly Apparitions
    3. Electronic-Voice Phenomena
    4. Near-Death Experiences
    5. Extrasensory Perception
  9. The Technological Prospect of Immortality
    1. Cryonics
    2. Strategies for Engineered Negligible Senescence
    3. Mind Uploading
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Semantic Problems

Discourse on immortality bears a semantic difficulty concerning the word 'death’. We usually define it in physiological terms as the cessation of biological functions that make life possible. But, if immortality is the continuation of life even after death, a contradiction appears to come up (Rosemberg, 1998). For apparently it makes no sense to say that someone has died and yet survived death. To be immortal is, precisely, not to suffer death. Thus, whoever dies, stops existing; nobody may exist after death, precisely because death means the end of existence.

For convenience, however, we may agree that ‘death’ simply means the decomposition of the body, but not necessarily the end of a person’s existence, as  assumed in most dictionary definitions. In such a manner, a person may ‘die’ in as much as their body no longer exists (or, to be more precise, no longer holds vital signs: pulse, brain activity, and so forth), but may continue to exist, either in an incorporeal state, with an ethereal body, or with some other physical body.

Some people may think of ‘immortality’ in vague and general terms, such as the continuity of a person’s deeds and memories among their friends and relatives. Thus, baseball player Babe Ruth is immortal in a very vague sense: he is well remembered among his fans. But, philosophically speaking, immortality implies the continuation of personal identity. Babe Ruth may be immortal in the sense that he is well remembered, but unless there is someone that may legitimately claim “I am Babe Ruth,” we shall presume Babe Ruth no longer exists and hence, is not immortal.

2. Three Models of Immortality

Despite the immense variety of beliefs on immortality, they may be reduced to three basic models: the survival of the astral body, the immaterial soul and resurrection (Flew, 2000). These models are not necessarily mutually exclusive; in fact, most religions have adhered to a combination of them.

a. The Survival of the Astral Body

Much primitive religious thought conceives that human beings are made up of two body substances: a physical body, susceptible of being touched, smelt, heard and seen; and an astral body made of some sort of mysterious ethereal substance. Unlike the physical body, the astral body has no solidity (it can go through walls, for example.) and hence, it cannot be touched, but it can be seen. Its appearance is similar to the physical body, except perhaps its color tonalities are lighter and its figure is fuzzier.

Upon death, the astral body detaches itself from the physical body, and mourns in some region within time and space. Thus, even if the physical body decomposes, the astral body survives. This is the type of immortality most commonly presented in films and literature (for example, Hamlet’s ghost). Traditionally, philosophers and theologians have not privileged this model of immortality, as there appears to be two insurmountable difficulties: 1) if the astral body does exist, it should be seen depart from the physical body at the moment of death; yet there is no evidence that accounts for it; 2) ghosts usually appear with clothes; this would imply that, not only are there astral bodies, but also astral clothes – a claim simply too extravagant to be taken seriously (Edwards, 1997: 21).

b. The Immaterial Soul

The model of the immortality of the soul is similar to the ‘astral body’ model, in as much as it considers that human beings are made up of two substances. But, unlike the ‘astral body’ model, this model conceives that the substance that survives the death of the body is not a body of some other sort, but rather, an immaterial soul. In as much as the soul is immaterial, it has no extension, and thus, it cannot be perceived through the senses. A few philosophers, such as Henry James, have come to believe that for something to exist, it must occupy space (although not necessarily physical space), and hence, souls are located somewhere in space (Henry, 2007). Up until the twentieth century, the majority of philosophers believed that persons are souls, and that human beings are made up of two substances (soul and body). A good portion of philosophers believed that the body is mortal and the soul is immortal. Ever since Descartes in the seventeenth century, most philosophers have considered that the soul is identical to the mind, and, whenever a person dies, their mental contents survive in an incorporeal state.

Eastern religions (for example, Hinduism and Buddhism) and some ancient philosophers (for example, Pythagoras and Plato) believed that immortal souls abandon the body upon death, may exist temporarily in an incorporeal state, and may eventually adhere to a new body at the time of birth (in some traditions, at the time of fertilization). This is the doctrine of reincarnation.

c. The Resurrection of the Body

Whereas most Greek philosophers believed that immortality implies solely the survival of the soul, the three great monotheistic religions (Judaism, Christianity and Islam) consider that immortality is achieved through the resurrection of the body at the time of the Final Judgment. The very same bodies that once constituted persons shall rise again, in order to be judged by God. None of these great faiths has a definite position on the existence of an immortal soul. Therefore, traditionally, Jews, Christians and Muslims have believed that, at the time of death, the soul detaches from the body and continues on to exist in an intermediate incorporeal state until the moment of resurrection. Some others, however, believe that there is no intermediate state: with death, the person ceases to exist, and in a sense, resumes existence at the time of resurrection.

As we shall see, some philosophers and theologians have postulated the possibility that, upon resurrection, persons do not rise with the very same bodies with which they once lived (rather, resurrected persons would be constituted by a replica). This version of the doctrine of the resurrection would be better referred to as ‘re-embodiment’: the person dies, but, as it were, is ‘re-embodied’.

3. Pragmatic Arguments for the Belief in Immortality

Most religions adhere to the belief in immortality on the basis of faith. In other words, they provide no proof of the survival of the person after the death of the body; actually, their belief in immortality appeals to some sort of divine revelation that, allegedly, does not require rationalization.

Natural theology, however, attempts to provide rational proofs of God’s existence. Some philosophers have argued that, if we can rationally prove that God exists, then we may infer that we are immortal. For, God, being omnibenevolent, cares about us, and thus would not allow the annihilation of our existence; and being just, would bring about a Final Judgement (Swinburne, 1997). Thus, the traditional arguments in favor of the existence of God (ontological, cosmological, teleological) would indirectly prove our immortality. However, these traditional arguments have been notoriously criticized, and some arguments against the existence of God have also been raised (such as the problem of evil) (Martin, 1992; Smith, 1999).

Nevertheless, some philosophers have indeed tried to rationalize the doctrine of immortality, and have come up with a few pragmatic arguments in its favor.

Blaise Pascal proposed a famous argument in favor of the belief in the existence of God, but it may well be extended to the belief in immortality (Pascal, 2005). The so-called ‘Pascal’s Wager’ argument goes roughly as follows: if we are to decide to believe whether God exists or not, it is wiser to believe that God does exist. If we rightly believe that God exists, , we gain eternal bliss; if God does not exist, we lose nothing, in as much as there is no Final Judgment to account for our error. On the other hand, if we rightly believe God does not exist, we gain nothing, in as much as there is no Final Judgment to reward our belief. But, if we wrongly believe that God does not exist, we lose eternal bliss, and are therefore damned to everlasting Hell. By a calculation of risks and benefits, we should conclude that it is better to believe in God’s existence. This argument is easily extensible to the belief in immortality: it is better to believe that there is a life after death, because if in fact there is a life after death, we shall be rewarded for our faith, and yet lose nothing if we are wrong; on the other hand, if we do not believe in a life after death, and we are wrong, we will be punished by God, and if we are right, there will not be a Final Judgment to reward our belief.

Although this argument has remained popular among some believers, philosophers have identified too many problems in it (Martin, 1992). Pascal’s Wager does not take into account the risk of believing in a false god (What if Baal were the real God, instead of the Christian God?), or the risk of believing in the wrong model of immortality (what if God rewarded belief in reincarnation, and punished belief in resurrection?). The argument also assumes that we are able to choose our beliefs, something most philosophers think very doubtful.

Other philosophers have appealed to other pragmatic benefits of the belief in immortality. Immanuel Kant famously rejected in his Critique of Pure Reason the traditional arguments in favor of the existence of God; but in his Critique of Practical Reason he put forth a so-called ‘moral argument’. The argument goes roughly as follows: belief in God and immortality is a prerequisite for moral action; if people do not believe there is a Final Judgment administered by God to account for deeds, there will be no motivation to be good. In Kant’s opinion, human beings seek happiness. But in order for happiness to coincide with moral action, the belief in an afterlife is necessary, because moral action does not guarantee happiness. Thus, the only way that a person may be moral and yet preserve happiness, is by believing that there will be an afterlife justice that will square morality with happiness. Perhaps Kant’s argument is more eloquently expressed in Ivan Karamazov’s (a character from Dostoevsky’s The Brothers Karamazov) famous phrase: “If there is no God, then everything is permitted... if there is no immortality, there is no virtue”.

The so-called ‘moral argument’ has been subject to some criticism. Many philosophers have argued that it is indeed possible to construe secular ethics, where appeal to God is unnecessary to justify morality. The question “why be moral?” may be answered by appealing to morality itself, to the need for cooperation, or simply, to one’s own pleasure (Singer, 1995; Martin, 1992). A vigilant God does not seem to be a prime need in order for man to be good. If these philosophers are right, the lack of belief in immortality would not bring about the collapse of morality. Some contemporary philosophers, however, align with Kant and believe that secular morality is shallow, as it does not satisfactorily account for acts of sacrifice that go against self-interest; in their view, the only way to account for such acts is by appealing to a Divine Judge (Mavrodes, 1995).

Yet another pragmatic argument in favor of the belief in immortality appeals to the need to find meaning in life. Perhaps Miguel de Unamuno’s Del sentimiento tràgico de la vida is the most emblematic philosophical treatise advocating this argument: in Unamuno’s opinion, belief in immortality is irrational, but nevertheless necessary to avoid desperation in the face of life’s absurdity. Only by believing that our lives will have an ever-lasting effect, do we find motivation to continue to live. If, on the contrary, we believe that everything will ultimately come to an end and nothing will survive, it becomes pointless to carry on any activity.

Of course, not all philosophers would agree. Some philosophers would argue that, on the contrary, the awareness that life is temporal and finite makes living more meaningful, in as much as we better appreciate opportunities (Heidegger, 1978). Bernard Williams has argued that, should life continue indefinitely, it would be terribly boring, and therefore, pointless (Williams, 1976). Some philosophers, however, counter that some activities may be endlessly repeated without ever becoming boring; furthermore, a good God would ensure that we never become bored in Heaven (Fischer, 2009).

Death strikes fear and anguish in many of us, and some philosophers argue that the belief in immortality is a much needed resource to cope with that fear. But, Epicurus famously argued that it is not rational to fear death, for two main reasons: 1) in as much as death is the extinction of consciousness, we are not aware of our condition (“if death is, I am not; if I am, death is not”); 2) in the same manner that we do not worry about the time that has passed before we were born, we should not worry about the time that will pass after we die (Rist, 1972).

At any rate, pragmatic arguments in favor of the belief in immortality are also critiqued on the grounds that the pragmatic benefits of a belief bear no implications on its truth. In other words, the fact that a belief is beneficial does not make it true. In the analytic tradition, philosophers have long argued for and against the pragmatic theory of truth, and depending on how this theory is valued, it will offer a greater or lesser plausibility to the arguments presented above.

4. Plato’s Arguments for Immortality

Plato was the first philosopher to argue, not merely in favor of the convenience of accepting the belief in immortality, but for the truth of the belief itself. His Phaedo is a dramatic representation of Socrates’ final discussion with his disciples, just before drinking the hemlock. Socrates shows no sign of fear or concern, for he is certain that he will survive the death of his body. He presents three main arguments to support his position, and some of these arguments are still in use today.

First, Socrates appeals to cycles and opposites. He believes that everything  has an opposite that is implied by it. And, as in cycles, things not only come from opposites, but also go towards opposites. Thus, when something is hot, it was previously cold; or when we are awake, we were previously asleep; but when we are asleep, we shall be awake once again. In the same manner, life and death are opposites in a cycle. Being alive is opposite to being dead. And, in as much as death comes from life, life must come from death. We come from death, and we go towards death. But, again, in as much as death comes from life, it will also go towards life. Thus, we had a life before being born, and we shall have a life after we die.

Most philosophers have not been persuaded by this argument. It is very doubtful that everything has an opposite (What is the opposite of a computer?) And, even if everything had an opposite, it is doubtful that everything comes from its opposite, or even that everything goes towards its opposite.

Socrates also appeals to the theory of reminiscence, the view that learning is really a process of ‘remembering’ knowledge from past lives. The soul must already exist before the birth of the body, because we seem to know things that were not available to us. Consider the knowledge of equality. If we compare two sticks and we realize they are not equal, we form a judgment on the basis of a previous knowledge of ‘equality’ as a form. That knowledge must come from previous lives. Therefore, this is an argument in favor of the transmigration of souls (that is, reincarnation or metempsychosis).

Some philosophers would dispute the existence of the Platonic forms, upon which this argument rests. And, the existence of innate ideas does not require the appeal to previous lives. Perhaps we are hard-wired by our brains to believe certain things; thus, we may know things that were not available to us previously.

Yet another of Socrates’ arguments appeals to the affinity between the soul and the forms. In Plato’s understanding, forms are perfect, immaterial and eternal. And, in as much as the forms are intelligible, but not sensible, only the soul can apprehend them. In order to apprehend something, the thing apprehending must have the same nature as the thing apprehended. The soul, then, shares the attributes of the forms: it is immaterial and eternal, and hence, immortal.

Again, the existence of the Platonic forms should not be taken for granted, and for this reason, this is not a compelling argument. Furthermore, it is doubtful that the thing apprehending must have the same nature as the thing apprehended: a criminologist need not be a criminal in order to apprehend the nature of crime.

5. Dualism

Plato’s arguments take for granted that souls exist; he only attempts to prove that they are immortal. But, a major area of discussion in the philosophy of mind is the existence of the soul. One of the doctrines that hold that the soul does exist is called ‘dualism’; its name comes from the fact that it postulates that human beings are made up of two substances: body and soul. Arguments in favor of dualism are indirectly arguments in favor of immortality, or at least in favor of the possibility of survival of death. For, if the soul exists, it is an immaterial substance. And, in as much as it is an immaterial substance, it is not subject to the decomposition of material things; hence, it is immortal.

Most dualists agree that the soul is identical to the mind, yet different from the brain or its functions. Some dualists believe the mind may be some sort of emergent property of the brain: it depends on the brain, but it is not identical to the brain or its processes. This position is often labeled ‘property dualism’, but here we are concerned with substance dualism, that is, the doctrine that holds that the mind is a separate substance (and not merely a separate property) from the body, and therefore, may survive the death of the body (Swinburne, 1997).

a. Descartes’ Arguments for Dualism

René Descartes is usually considered the father of dualism, as he presents some very ingenuous arguments in favor of the existence of the soul as a separate substance (Descartes, 1980). In perhaps his most celebrated argument, Descartes invites a thought experiment: imagine you exist, but not your body. You wake up in the morning, but as you approach the mirror, you do not see yourself there. You try to reach your face with your hand, but it is thin air. You try to scream, but no sound comes out. And so on.

Now, Descartes believes that it is indeed possible to imagine such a scenario. But, if one can imagine the existence of a person without the existence of the body, then persons are not constituted by their bodies, and hence, mind and body are two different substances. If the mind were identical to the body, it would be impossible to imagine the existence of the mind without imagining at the same time the existence of the body.

This argument has been subject to much scrutiny. Dualists certainly believe it is a valid one, but it is not without its critics. Descartes seems to assume that everything that is imaginable is possible. Indeed, many philosophers have long agreed that imagination is a good guide as to what is possible (Hume, 2010). But, this criterion is disputed. Imagination seems to be a psychological process, and thus not strictly a logical process. Therefore, perhaps we can imagine scenarios that are not really possible. Consider the Barber Paradox. At first, it seems possible that, in a town, a man shaves only those persons that shave themselves. We may perhaps imagine such a situation, but logically there cannot be such a situation, as Bertrand Russell showed. The lesson to be learned is that imagination might not be a good guide to possibility. And, although Descartes appears to have no trouble imagining an incorporeal mind, such a scenario might not be possible. However, dualists may argue that there is no neat difference between a psychological and a logical process, as logic seems to be itself a psychological process.

Descartes presents another argument. As Leibniz would later formalize in the Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles, two entities can be considered identical, if and only if, they exhaustively share the same attributes. Descartes exploits this principle, and attempts to find a property of the mind not shared by the body (or vice versa), in order to argue that they are not identical, and hence, are separate substances.

Descartes states: “There is a great difference between a mind and a body, because the body, by its very nature, is something divisible, whereas the mind is plainly indivisible. . . insofar as I am only a thing that thinks, I cannot distinguish any parts in me. . . . Although the whole mind seems to be united to the whole body, nevertheless, were a foot or an arm or any other bodily part amputated, I know that nothing would be taken away from the mind” (Descartes, 1980: 97).

Descartes believed, then, that mind and body cannot be the same substance. Descartes put forth another similar argument: the body has extension in space, and as such, it can be attributed physical properties. We may ask, for instance, what the weight of a hand is, or what the longitude of a leg is. But the mind has no extension, and therefore, it has no physical properties. It makes no sense to ask what the color of the desire to eat strawberries is, or what the weight of Communist ideology is. If the body has extension, and the mind has no extension, then the mind can be considered a separate substance.

Yet another of Descartes’ arguments appeals to some difference between mind and body. Descartes famously contemplated the possibility that an evil demon might be deceiving him about the world. Perhaps the world is not real. In as much as that possibility exists, Descartes believed that one may be doubt the existence of one’s own body. But, Descartes argued that one cannot doubt the existence of one’s own mind. For, if one doubts, one is thinking; and if one thinks, then it can be taken for certain that one’s mind exists. Hence Descartes famous phrase: “cogito ergo sum”, I think, therefore, I exist. Now, if one may doubt the existence of one’s body, but cannot doubt the existence of one’s mind, then mind and body are different substances. For, again, they do not share exhaustively the same attributes.

These arguments are not without critics. Indeed, Leibniz’s Principle of Indiscernibles would lead us to think that, in as much as mind and body do not exhaustively share the same properties, they cannot be the same substance. But, in some contexts, it seems possible that A and B may be identical, even if that does not imply that everything predicated of A can be predicated of B.

Consider, for example, a masked man that robs a bank. If we were to ask a witness whether or not the masked man robbed the bank, the witness will answer “yes!”. But, if we were to ask the witness whether his father robbed the bank, he may answer “no”. That, however, does not imply that the witness’ father is not the bank robber: perhaps the masked man was the witness’ father, and the witness was not aware of it. This is the so-called ‘Masked Man Fallacy’.

This case forces us to reconsider Leibniz’s Law: A is identical to B, not if everything predicated of A is predicated of B, but rather, when A and B share exhaustively the same properties. And, what people believe about substances are not properties. To be an object of doubt is not, strictly speaking, a property, but rather, an intentional relation. And, in our case, to be able to doubt the body’s existence, but not the mind’s existence, does not imply that mind and body are not the same substance.

b. More Recent Dualist Arguments

In more recent times, Descartes’ strategy has been used by other dualist philosophers to account for the difference between mind and body. Some philosophers argue that the mind is private, whereas the body is not. Any person may know the state of my body, but no person, including even possibly myself, can truly know the state of my mind.

Some philosophers point ‘intentionality’ as another difference between mind and body. The mind has intentionality, whereas the body does not. Thoughts are about something, whereas body parts are not. In as much as thoughts have intentionality, they may also have truth values. Not all thoughts, of course, are true or false, but at least those thoughts that pretend to represent the world, may be. On the other hand, physical states do not have truth values: neurons activating in the brain are neither ‘true’, nor ‘false’.

Again, these arguments exploit the differences between mind and body. But, very much as with Descartes’ arguments, it is not absolutely clear that they avoid the Masked Man Fallacy.

c. Arguments against Dualism

Opponents of dualism not only reject their arguments; they also highlight conceptual and empirical problems with this doctrine. Most opponents of dualism are materialists: they believe that mental stuff is really identical to the brain, or at the most, an epiphenomenon of the brain. Materialism limits the prospects for immortality: if the mind is not a separate substance from the brain, then at the time of the brain’s death, the mind also becomes extinct, and hence, the person does not survive death. Materialism need not undermine all expectations of immortality (see resurrection below), but it does undermine the immortality of the soul.

The main difficulty with dualism is the so-called ‘interaction problem’. If the mind is an immaterial substance, how can it interact with material substances? The desire to move my hand allegedly moves my hand, but how exactly does that occur? There seems to be an inconsistency with the mind’s immateriality: some of the time, the mind is immaterial and is not affected by material states, at other times, the mind manages to be in contact with the body and cause its movement. Daniel Dennett has ridiculed this inconsistency by appealing to the comic-strip character Casper. This friendly ghost is immaterial because he is able to go through walls. But, all of a sudden, he is also able to catch a ball. The same inconsistency appears with dualism: in its interaction with the body, sometimes the mind does not interact with the body, sometimes it does (Dennett, 1992).Dualists have offered some solutions to this problem. Occasionalists hold that God directly causes material events. Thus, mind and body never interact. Likewise, parallelists hold that mental and physical events are coordinated by God so that they appear to cause each other, but in fact, they do not. These alternatives are in fact rejected by most contemporary philosophers.

Some dualists, however, may reply that the fact that we cannot fully explain how body and soul interact, does not imply that interaction does not take place. We know many things happen in the universe, although we do not know how they happen. Richard Swinburne, for instance, argues as follows: “That bodily events cause brain events and that these cause pains, images, and beliefs (where their subjects have privileged access to the latter and not the former), is one of the most obvious phenomena of human experience. If we cannot explain how that occurs, we should not try to pretend that it does not occur. We should just acknowledge that human beings are not omniscient, and cannot understand everything” (Swinburne, 1997, xii).

On the other hand, Dualism postulates the existence of an incorporeal mind, but it is not clear that this is a coherent concept. In the opinion of most dualists, the incorporeal mind does perceive. But, it is not clear how the mind can perceive without sensory organs. Descartes seemed to have no problems in imagining an incorporeal existence, in his thought experiment. However, John Hospers, for instance, believes that such a scenario is simply not imaginable:

You see with eyes? No, you have no eyes, since you have no body. But let that pass for a moment; you have experiences similar to what you would have if you had eyes to see with. But how can you look toward the foot of the bed or toward the mirror? Isn’t looking an activity that requires having a body? How can you look in one direction or another if you have no head to turn? And this isn’t all; we said that you can’t touch your body because there is no body there; how did you discover this?... Your body seems to be involved in every activity we try to describe even though we have tried to imagine existing without it. (Hospers, 1997: 280)

Furthermore, even if an incorporeal existence were in fact possible, it could be terribly lonely. For, without a body, could it be possible to communicate with other minds. In Paul Edward’s words: “so far from living on in paradise, a person deprived of his body and thus of all sense organs would, quite aside from many other gruesome deprivations, be in a state of desolate loneliness and eventually come to prefer annihilation”. (Edwards, 1997:48). However, consider that, even in the absence of a body, great pleasures may be attained. We may live in a situation the material world is an illusion (in fact, idealists inspired in Berkley lean towards such a position), and yet, enjoy existence. For, even without a body, we may enjoy sensual pleasures that, although not real, certainly feel real. However, the problems with dualism do not end there. If souls are immaterial and have no spatial extension, how can they be separate from other souls? Separation implies extension. Yet, if the soul has no extension, it is not at all clear how one soul can be distinguished from another. Perhaps souls can be distinguished based on their contents, but then again, how could we distinguish two souls with exactly the same contents? Some contemporary dualists have responded thus: in as much as souls interact with bodies, they have a spatial relationships to bodies, and in a sense, can be individuated.

Perhaps the most serious objection to dualism, and a substantial argument in favor of materialism, is the mind’s correlation with the brain. Recent developments in neuroscience increasingly confirm that mental states depend upon brain states. Neurologists have been able to identify certain regions of the brain associated with specific mental dispositions. And, in as much as there appears to be a strong correlation between mind and brain, it seems that the mind may be reducible to the brain, and would therefore not be a separate substance.

In the last recent decades, neuroscience has accumulated data that confirm that cerebral damage has a great influence on the mental constitution of persons. Phineas Gage’s case is well-known in this respect: Gage had been a responsible and kind railroad worker, but had an accident that resulted in damage to the frontal lobes of his brain. Ever since, Gage turned into an aggressive, irresponsible person, unrecognizable by his peers (Damasio, 2006).

Departing from Gage’s case, scientists have inferred that frontal regions of the brain strongly determine personality. And, if mental contents can be severely damaged by brain injuries, it does not seem right to postulate that the mind is an immaterial substance. If, as dualism postulates, Gage had an immortal immaterial soul, why didn’t his soul remain intact after his brain injury?

A similar difficulty arises when we consider degenerative neurological diseases, such as Alzheimer’s disease. As it is widely known, this disease progressively eradicates the mental contents of patients, until patients lose memory almost completely. If most memories eventually disappear, what remains of the soul? When a patient afflicted with Alzheimer dies, what is it that survives, if precisely, most of his memories have already been lost? Of course, correlation is not identity, and the fact that the brain is empirically correlated with the mind does not imply that the mind is the brain. But, many contemporary philosophers of mind adhere to the so-called ‘identity theory’: mental states are the exact same thing as the firing of specific neurons.

Dualists may respond by claiming that the brain is solely an instrument of the soul. If the brain does not work properly, the soul will not work properly, but brain damage does not imply a degeneration of the soul. Consider, for example, a violinist. If the violin does not play accurately, the violinist will not perform well. But, that does not imply that the violinist has lost their talent. In the same manner, a person may have a deficient brain, and yet, retain her soul intact. However, Occam’s Razor requires the more parsimonious alternative: in which case, unless there is any compelling evidence in its favor, there is no need to assume the existence of a soul that uses the brain as its instrument.

Dualists may also suggest that the mind is not identical to the soul. In fact, whereas many philosophers tend to consider the soul and mind identical, various religions consider that a person is actually made up of by three substances: body, mind and soul. In such a view, even if the mind degenerates, the soul remains. However, it would be far from clear what the soul exactly could be, if it is not identical to the mind.

6. A Brief Digression: Criteria for Personal Identity

Any philosophical discussion on immortality touches upon a fundamental issue concerning persons–personal identity. If we hope to survive death, we would want to be sure that the person that continues to exist after death is the same person that existed before death. And, for religions that postulate a Final Judgment, this is a crucial matter: if God wants to apply justice, the person rewarded or punished in the afterlife must be the very same person whose deeds determine the outcome.

The question of personal identity refers to the criterion upon which a person remains the same (that is, numerical identity) throughout time. Traditionally, philosophers have discussed three main criteria: soul, body and psychological continuity.

a. The Soul Criterion

According to the soul criterion for personal identity, persons remains the same throughout time, if and only if, they retain their soul (Swinburne, 2004). Philosophers who adhere to this criterion usually do not think the soul is identical to the mind. The soul criterion is favored by very few philosophers, as it faces a huge difficulty: if the soul is an immaterial non-apprehensible substance (precisely, in as much as it is not identical to the mind), how can we be sure that a person continues to be the same? We simply do not know if, in the middle of the night, our neighbor’s soul has transferred into another body. Even if our neighbor’s body and mental contents remain the same, we can never know if his soul is the same. Under this criterion, it appears that there is simply no way to make sure someone is always the same person.

However, there is a considerable argument in favor of the soul criterion. To pursue such an argument, Richard Swinburne proposes the following thought experiment: suppose John’s brain is successfully split in two, and as a result, we get two persons; one with the left hemisphere of John’s brain, the other with the right hemisphere. Now, which one is John? Both have a part of John’s brain, and both conserve part of John’s mental contents.  So, one of them must presumably be John, but which one? Unlike the body and the mind, the soul is neither divisible nor duplicable. Thus, although we do not know which would be John, we do know that only one of the two persons is John. And it would be the person that preserves John’s souls, even if we have no way of identifying it. In such a manner, although we know about John’s body and mind, we are not able to discern who is John; therefore, John’s identity is not his mind or his body, but rather, his soul (Swinburne, 2010: 68).

b. The Body Criterion

Common sense informs that persons are their bodies (in fact, that is how we recognize people ) but, although many philosophers would dispute this,  ordinary people seem generally to adhere to such a view). Thus, under this criterion, a person continues to be the same, if, and only if, they conserve the same body. Of course, the body alters, and eventually, all of its cells are replaced. This evokes the ancient philosophical riddle known as the Ship of Theseus: the planks of Theseus’ ship were gradually replaced, until none of the originals remained. Is it still the same ship? There has been much discussion on this, but most philosophers agree that, in the case of the human body, the total replacement of atoms and the slight alteration of form do not alter the numerical identity of the human body.

However, the body criterion soon runs into difficulties. Imagine two patients, Brown and Robinson, who undergo surgery simultaneously. Accidentally, their brains are swapped in placed in the wrong body. Thus, Brown’s brain is placed in Robinson’s body. Let us call this person Brownson. Naturally, in as much as he has Brown’s brain, he will have Brown’s memories, mental contents, and so forth. Now, who is Brownson? Is he Robinson with Brown’s brain; or is he Brown with Robinson’s body? Most people would think the latter (Shoemaker, 2003). After all, the brain is the seat of consciousness.

Thus, it would appear that the body criterion must give way to the brain criterion: a person continues to be the same, if and only if, she conserves the same brain. But, again, we run into difficulties. What if the brain undergoes fission, and each half is placed in a new body? (Parfit, 1984). As a result, we would have two persons pretending to be the original person, but, because of the principle of transitivity, we know that both of them cannot be the original person. And, it seems arbitrary that one of them should be the original person, and not the other (although, as we have seen, Swinburne bites the bullet, and considers that, indeed, only one would be the original person). This difficulty invites the consideration of other criteria for personal identity.

c. The Psychological Criterion

John Locke famously asked what we would think if a prince one day woke up in a cobbler’s body, and the cobbler in a prince’s body (Locke, 2009). Although the cobbler’s peers would recognize him as the cobbler, he would have the memories of the prince. Now, if before that event, the prince committed a crime, who should be punished? Should it be the man in the palace, who remembers being a cobbler; or should it be the man in the workshop, who remembers being a prince, including his memory of the crime?

It seems that the man in the workshop should be punished for the prince’s crime, because, even if that is not the prince’s original body, that person is the prince, in as much as he conserves his memories. Locke, therefore, believed that a person continues to be the same, if and only if, she conserves psychological continuity.

Although it appears to be an improvement with regards to the previous two criteria, the psychological criterion also faces some problems. Suppose someone claims today to be Guy Fawkes, and conserves intact very vividly and accurately the memories of the seventeenth century conspirator (Williams, 1976). By the psychological criterion, such a person would indeed be Guy Fawkes. But, what if, simultaneously, another person also claims to be Guy Fawkes, even with the same degree of accuracy? Obviously, both persons cannot be Guy Fawkes. Again, it would seem arbitrary to conclude that one person is Guy Fawkes, yet the other person isn’t. It seems more plausible that neither person is Guy Fawkes, and therefore, that psychological continuity is not a good criterion for personal identity.

d. The Bundle Theory

In virtue of the difficulties with the above criteria, some philosophers have argued that, in a sense, persons do not exist. Or, to be more precise, the self does not endure changes. In David Hume’s words, a person is “nothing but a bundle or collection of different perceptions, which succeed each other with an inconceivable rapidity, and are in a perpetual flux and movement” (Hume, 2010: 178). This is the so-called ‘bundle theory of the self’.

As a corollary, Derek Parfit argues that, when considering survival, personal identity is not what truly matters (Parfit, 1984). What does matter is psychological continuity. Parfit asks us to consider this example.

Suppose that you enter a cubicle in which, when you press a button, a scanner records the states of all the cells in your brain and body, destroying both while doing so. This information is then transmitted at the speed of light to some other planet, where a replicator produces a perfect organic copy of you. Since the brain of your replica is exactly like yours, it will seem to remember living your life up to the moment when you pressed the button, its character will be just like yours, it will be every other way psychologically continuous with you. (Parfit, 1997: 311)

Now, under the psychological criterion, such a replica will in fact be you. But, what if the machine does not destroy the original body, or makes more than one replica? In such a case, there will be two persons claiming to be you. As we have seen, this is a major problem for the psychological criterion. But, Parfit argues that, even if the person replicated is not the same person that entered the cubicle, it is psychologically continuous. And, that is what is indeed relevant.

Parfit’s position has an important implication for discussions of immortality. According to this view, a person in the afterlife is not the same person that lived before. But, that should not concern us. We should be concerned about the prospect that, in the afterlife, there will at least be one person that is psychologically continuous with us.

7. Problems with the Resurrection of the Body

As we have seen, the doctrine of resurrection postulates that on Judgment Day the bodies of every person who ever lived shall rise again, in order to be judged by God. Unlike the doctrine of the immortality of the soul, the doctrine of resurrection has not been traditionally defended with philosophical arguments. Most of its adherents accept it on the basis of faith. Some Christians, however, consider that the resurrection of Jesus can be historically demonstrated (Habermas, 2002; Craig, 2008). And, so the argument goes, if it can be proven that God resurrected Jesus from the dead, then we can expect that God will do the same with every human being who has ever lived.

Nevertheless, the doctrine of resurrection runs into some philosophical problems derived from considerations on personal identity; that is, how is the person resurrected identical to the person that once lived? If we were to accept dualism and the soul criterion for personal identity, then there is not much of a problem: upon the moment of death, soul and body split, the soul remains incorporeal until the moment of resurrection, and the soul becomes attached to the new resurrected body. In as much as a person is the same, if and only if, she conserves the same soul, then we may legitimately claim that the resurrected person is identical to the person that once lived.

But, if we reject dualism, or the soul criterion for personal identity, then we must face some difficulties. According to the most popular one conception of resurrection, we shall be raised with the same bodies with which we once lived. Suppose that the resurrected body is in fact made of the very same cells that made up the original body, and also, the resurrected body has the same form as the original body. Are they identical?

Peter Van Inwagen thinks not (Van Inwagen, 1997). If, for example, an original manuscript written by Augustine is destroyed, and then, God miraculously recreates a manuscript with the same atoms that made up Augustine’s original manuscript, we should not consider it the very same manuscript. It seems that, between Augustine’s original manuscript, and the manuscript recreated by God, there is no spatio-temporal continuity. And, if such continuity is lacking, then we cannot legitimately claim that the recreated object is the same original object. For the same reason, it appears that the resurrected body cannot be identical to the original body. At most, the resurrected body would be a replica.

However, our intuitions are not absolutely clear. Consider, for example, the following case: a bicycle is exhibited in a store, and a customer buys it. In order to take it home, the customer dismantles the bicycle, puts its pieces in a box, takes it home, and once there, reassembles the pieces. Is it the same bicycle? It certainly seems so, even if there is no spatio-temporal continuity.

Nevertheless, there is room to doubt that the resurrected body would be made up of the original body’s same atoms. We know that matter recycles itself, and that due to metabolism, the atoms that once constituted the human body of a person may later constitute the body of another person. How could God resurrect bodies that shared the same atoms? Consider the case of cannibalism, as ridiculed by Voltaire:

A soldier from Brittany goes into Canada; there, by a very common chance, he finds himself short of food, and is forced to eat an Iroquis whom he killed the day before. The Iroquis had fed on Jesuits for two or three months; a great part of his body had become Jesuit. Here, then, the body of a soldier is composed of Iroquis, of Jesuits, and of all that he had eaten before. How is each to take again precisely what belongs to him? And which part belongs to each? (Voltaire, 1997: 147)

However, perhaps, in the resurrection, God needn’t resurrect the body. If we accept the body criterion for personal identity, then, indeed, the resurrected body must be the same original body. But, if we accept the psychological criterion, perhaps God only needs to recreate a person psychologically continuous with the original person, regardless of whether or not that person has the same body. John Hick believes this is how God could indeed proceed (Hick, 1994).

Hick invites a thought experiment. Suppose a man disappears in London, and suddenly someone with his same looks and personality appears in New York. It seems reasonable to consider that the person that disappeared in London is the same person that appeared in New York. Now, suppose that a man dies in London, and suddenly appears in New York with the same looks and personality. Hick believes that, even if the cadaver is in London, we would be justified to claim that the person that appears in New York is the same person that died in London. Hick’s implication is that body continuity is not needed for personal identity; only psychologically continuity is necessary.

And, Hick considers that, in the same manner, if a person dies, and someone in the resurrection world appears with the same character traits, memories, and so forth, then we should conclude that such a person in the resurrected world is identical to the person who previously died. Hick admits the resurrected body would be a replica, but as long as the resurrected is psychologically continuous with the original person, then it is identical to the original person.

Yet, in as much as Hick’s model depends upon a psychological criterion for personal identity, it runs into the same problems that we have reviewed when considering the psychological criterion. It seems doubtful that a replica would be identical to the original person, because more than one replica could be recreated. And, if there is more than one replica, then they would all claim to be the original person, but obviously, they cannot all be the original person. Hick postulates that we can trust that God would only recreate exactly one replica, but it is not clear how that would solve the problem. For, the mere possibility that God could make more than one replica is enough to conclude that a replica would not be the original person.

Peter Van Inwagen has offered a somewhat extravagant solution to these problems: “Perhaps at the moment of each man’s death, God removes his corpse and replaces it with a simulacrum which is what is burned or rots. Or perhaps God is not quite so wholesale as this: perhaps He removes for ‘safekeeping’ only the ‘core person’ – the brain and central nervous system – or even some special part of it” (Van Inwagen, 1997: 246). This would seem to solve the problem of spatio-temporal continuity. The body would never cease to exist, it would only be stored somewhere else until the moment of resurrection, and therefore, it would conserve spatio-temporal continuity. However, such an alternative seems to presuppose a deceitful God (He would make us believe the corpse that rots is the original one, when in fact, it is not), and would thus contradict the divine attribute of benevolence (a good God would not lie), a major tenet of monotheistic religions that defend the doctrine of resurrection.

Some Christian philosophers are aware of all these difficulties, and have sought a more radical solution: there is no criterion for personal identity over time. Such a view is not far from the bundle theory, in the sense that it is difficult to precise how a person remains the same over time. This position is known as ‘anti-criterialism’, that is, there is no intelligible criterion for personal identity; Trenton Merricks (1998) is its foremost proponent. By doing away with criteria for personal identity, anti-criterialists purport to show that objections to resurrection based on difficulties of personal identity have little weight, precisely because we should not be concerned about criteria for personal identity.

8. Parapsychology

The discipline of parapsychology purports to prove that there is scientific evidence for the afterlife; or at least, that there is scientific evidence for the existence of paranormal abilities that would imply that the mind is not a material substance. Originally founded by J.B.S. Rhine in the 1950s, parapsychology has fallen out of favor among contemporary neuroscientists, although some universities still support parapsychology departments.

a. Reincarnation

Parapsychologists usually claim there is a good deal of evidence in favor of the doctrine of reincarnation. Two pieces of alleged evidence are especially meaningful: (1) past-life regressions; (2) cases of children who apparently remember past lives.

Under hypnosis, some patients frequently have regressions and remember events from their childhood. But, some patients have gone even further and, allegedly, have vivid memories of past lives. A few parapsychologists take these as so-called ‘past-life regressions’ as evidence for reincarnation (Sclotterbeck, 2003).

However, past-life regressions may be cases of cryptomnesia, that is, hidden memories. A person may have a memory, and yet not recognize it as such. A well-known case is illustrative: an American woman in the 1950s was hypnotized, and claimed to be Bridey Murphy, an Irishwoman of the 19th century. Under hypnosis, the woman offered a fairly good description of 19th century Ireland, although she had never been in Ireland. However, it was later discovered that, as a child, she had an Irish neighbor. Most likely, she had hidden memories of that neighbor, and under hypnosis, assumed the personality of a 20th century Irish woman.

It must also be kept in mind that hypnosis is a state of high suggestibility. The person that conducts the hypnosis may easily induce false memories on the person hypnotized; hence, alleged memories that come up in hypnosis are not trustworthy at all.

Some children have claimed to remember past lives. Parapsychologist Ian Stevenson collected more than a thousand of such cases (Stevenson, 2001). And, in a good portion of those cases, children know things about the deceased person that, allegedly, they could not have known otherwise.

However, Stevenson’s work has been severely critiqued for its methodological flaws. In most cases, the child’s family had already made contact with the deceased’s family before Stevenson’s arrival; thus, the child could pick up information and give the impression that he knows more than what he could have known. Paul Edwards has also accused Stevenson of asking leading questions towards his own preconceptions (Edwards, 1997: 14).

Moreover, reincarnation runs into conceptual problems of its own. If you do not remember past lives, then it seems that you cannot legitimately claim that you are the same person whose life you do not remember. However, a few philosophers claim this is not a good objection at all, as you do not remember being a very young child, and yet can still surely claim to be the same person as that child (Ducasse, 1997: 199).

Population growth also seems to be a problem for reincarnation: according to defenders of reincarnation, souls migrate from one body to another. This, in a sense,  presupposes that the number of souls remains stable, as no new souls are created, they only migrate from body to body. Yet, the number of bodies has consistently increased ever since the dawn of mankind. Where, one may ask, were all souls before new bodies came to exist? (Edwards, 1997: 14). Actually, this objection is not so formidable: perhaps souls exist in a disembodied form as they wait for new bodies to come up (D’Souza, 2009: 57).

b. Mediums and Ghostly Apparitions

During the heyday of Spiritualism (the religious movement that sought to make contact with the dead), some mediums gained prominence for their reputed abilities to contact the dead. These mediums were of two kinds: physical mediums invoked spirits that, allegedly, produced physical phenomena (for example, lifting tables); and mental mediums whose bodies, allegedly, were temporarily possessed by the spirits.

Most physical mediums were exposed as frauds by trained magicians. Mental mediums, however, presented more of a challenge for skeptics. During their alleged possession by a deceased person’s spirit, mediums would provide information about the deceased person that, apparently, could not have possibly known. William James was impressed by one such medium, Leonora Piper, and although he remained somewhat skeptical, he finally endorsed the view that Piper in fact made contact with the dead.

Some parapsychologists credit the legitimacy of mental mediumship (Almeder, 1992). However, most scholars believe that mental mediums work through the technique of ‘cold reading’: they ask friends and relatives of a deceased person questions at a fast pace, and infer from their body language and other indicators, information about the deceased person (Gardner, 2003).

Parapsychologists have also gathered testimonies of alleged ghost appearances, especially cases where the spirit communicates something that no person could have known (for example, the location of a hidden treasure), and yet it is corroborated. This evidence seems far too anecdotal to be taken seriously; it does not go through the rigorous control that such a claim would require.

c. Electronic-Voice Phenomena

Some parapsychologists have tried to record white noise generated by vacant radio stations, and in places where it is known that no person is present (Raudive, 1991). Allegedly, some of those recordings have produced noises similar to human voices with strange messages, and these voices are believed to come from ghosts. Skeptics claim that such messages are too vague to be taken seriously, and that the tendency of the human mind to find purpose everywhere, promotes the interpretation of simple noises as human voices.

d. Near-Death Experiences

Ever since ancient times (for example, Plato’s myth of Er in The Republic), there have been reports of people who have lost some vital signs, and yet, regained them after a brief period of time. Some people have claimed to have unique experiences in those moments: an acute noise, a peaceful and relaxed sensation; the feeling of abandoning the body, floating in the air and watching the body from above; a passage thorough a dark tunnel; a bright light at the end of the tunnel; an encounter with friends, relatives, and religious characters; a review of life’s most important moments. These are described as near death experiences (Moody, 2001).

Some parapsychologists claim near death experiences are evidence of life after death, and some sort of window revealing the nature of the afterlife. Skeptical scientists, however, have offered plausible physiological explanations for such experiences. Carl Sagan considered the possibility that near death experiences evoke memories from the moment of birth: the transit through the tunnel would evoke the birth canal, and the sensation of floating in the air would evoke the sensation of floating in amniotic acid during gestation (Sagan, 1980).

There are still other physiological explanations. These experiences can be induced by stimulating certain regions of the brain. In moments of intense crises, the brain releases endorphins, and this may account for the peaceful and relaxed sensation. The experience of going through a tunnel may be due to anoxia (lack of oxygen), or the application of anesthetics containing quetamine. The review of life’s most important moments may be due to the stimulation of neurons in the temporal lobules. Encounters with religious characters may be hallucinations as a result of anoxia (Blackmore, 2002) Some patients that have undergone near death experiences have allegedly provided verifiable information that they had no way to know. Some parapsychologists take this as evidence that patients float through the air during near death experiences and, during the ordeal, they are capable to travel to other locations. This evidence is, however, anecdotal. And there is contrary evidence: Researchers have placed computer laptops with random images in the roof of emergency rooms, so that only someone watching from above could know the content of the images, but, so far, no patient has ever accurately described such images (Roach, 2005).

e. Extrasensory Perception

Parapsychologists have designed some experiments that purport to prove that some people have the ability of extrasensory perception or ESP (Radin, 1997). If this ability does indeed exist, it would not prove immortality, but it would seem to prove dualism; that is, the mind is not reducible to the brain.

The best formulated experiment is the so-called Ganzfeld experiment. Person A relaxes in a cabin, her eyes are covered with ping-pong ball halves, and listens to white noise for fifteen minutes. This is intended to promote sense deprivation. In another cabin, person B is shown a target image. Afterwards, subject A is shown the target image, along with three other images. We should expect a 25% chance probability that subject A will choose the target image, but when experiments are performed, 32% of the time, subject A is successful. Parapsychologists claim this is evidence that something strange is going on (as it defies the expectancy of chance), and their explanation is that some people have the ability of extra sensory perception.

However, this experiment is not without critics. There may be sensory leakage (perhaps the cabins are not sufficiently isolated from each other). The experiment’s protocols have not adequately presented the images in random sequences. And, even if, indeed, the results come out 32% accurate when only 25% is expected by chance, it should not be assumed that a paranormal phenomenon is going on; at most, further research would be required to satisfactorily reach a conclusion.

9. The Technological Prospect of Immortality

Most secular scientists have little patience for parapsychology or religiously-inspired immortality. However, the exponential growth of technological innovation in our era has allowed the possibility to consider that, in a not-too-distant future, bodily immortality may become a reality. A few of these proposed technologies raise philosophical issues.

a. Cryonics

Cryonics is the preservation of corpses in low temperatures. Although it is not a technology that purports to bring persons back to life, it does purport to conserve them until some future technology might be capable of resuscitating dead bodies. If, indeed, such technology were ever developed, we would need to revise the physiological criterion for death. For, if brain death is a physiological point of no return, then bodies that are currently cryogenically preserved and will be brought back to life, were not truly dead after all.

b. Strategies for Engineered Negligible Senescence

Most scientists are skeptical of the prospect of resuscitating already dead people, but some are more enthusiastic about the prospect of indefinitely procrastinating death by stopping the aging processes. Scientist Aubrey De Grey has proposed some strategies for engineered negligible senescence: their goal is to identify the mechanisms accountable for aging, and attempt to stop, or even, reverse them (by, say cell repair) (De Grey and Rae, 2008). Some of these strategies involve genetic manipulation and nanotechnology, and hence they bring forth ethical issues. These strategies also bring concern about the ethics of immortality, that is, is immortality even desirable? (See section 3 of this article).

c. Mind Uploading

Yet other futurists consider that, even if it were not possible to indefinitely suspend the body’s death, it would at least be possible to emulate the brain with artificial intelligence (Kurzweil, 1993; Moravec, 2003). Thus, some scientists have considered the prospect of ‘mind-uploading’, that is, the transfer of the mind’s information to a machine. Hence, even if the organic brain dies, the mind could continue to exist once it is uploaded in a silicon-based machine.

Two crucial philosophical issues are raised by this prospect. First, the field of philosophy of artificial intelligence raises the question: could a machine ever really be conscious? Philosophers who adhere to a functionalist understanding of the mind would agree; but other philosophers would not (Consider Searle’s Chinese Room Argument in Searle, 1998).

Even if we were to claim that a machine could in fact be conscious, the technological prospect of mind uploading raises a second philosophical issue: would an emulation of the brain preserve personal identity? If we adhere to a soul or body criterion of personal identity, we should answer negatively. If we adhere to a psychological criterion of personal identity, then we should answer affirmatively, for the artificial brain would indeed be psychologically continuous with the original person.

10. References and Further Reading

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  • Barnes, Jonathan. The Presocratic Philosophers: Thales to Zeno. Routledge. 1979.
  • Beloff, John. Parapsychology: A Concise History. Palgrave. 1997.
  • Bernstein, Morey. The Search for Bridey Murphy. Doubleday. 1956.
  • Blackmore, Susan. “Near-Death Experiencies”. in Shermer, Michael (Ed.). Skeptic Encyclopedia of Pseudoscience. ABC Clio. 2002, p. 150-155.
  • Blackmore, Susan. Consciousness: A Very Short Introduction. Oxford University Press. 2005.
  • Blum, Deborah. Ghost Hunters: William James and the Search for Scientific Proof of Life After Death. Penguin. 2007.
  • Broad, C.D. “On Survival Without a Body” in Edwards, Paul (Ed.) Immortality. Prometheus. 1997, pp. 276-278.
  • Carter, Matt. Minds and Computers: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Artificial Intelligence. Edinburgh University Press. 2007.
  • Chalmers, David. The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory. Oxford University Press. 1996.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. Person and Object. Routledge. 2002.
  • Churchland, Paul. Neurophilosophy at Work. Cambridge University Press. 2007.
  • Craig. William. Reasonable Faith: Christian Truth and Apologetics. Crossway Books. 2008.
  • Cranston, S.L. and Williams, Carey. Reincarnation: A New Horizon in Science, Religion and Society. Julian Press, 1984.
  • Damasio, Antonio. Descartes’ Error: Emotion, Reason and The Human Brain. Vintage Books. 2006.
  • Damer, T. Edward. Attacking Faulty Reasoning. Cengage Learning. 2008.
  • De Grey, Aubrey and Rae, Michael. Ending Aging: The Rejuvenation Breakthroughs That Could Reverse Human Aging in Our Lifetime. St. Martin's Griffin. 2008
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  • Dennett, Daniel. Conciousness Explained. Back Bay Books. 1992.
  • Descartes, René. Discourse on Method and Meditations on First Philosophy, Donald A. Cress trans. Hackett Publishing Co 1980.
  • D’Souza, Dinseh. Life After Death. Regnery Publishing. 2009
  • Ducasse, C.J. “Survival as Transmigration” in Edwards, Paul (Ed.). Immortality. Prometheus. 1997, pp. 194-199.
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  • Merricks, Trenton. “There are No Criteria of Identity Over Time.” Noûs 32: 106-124. 1998.
  • Minsky, Marvin. The Emotion Machine: Commonsense Thinking, Artificial Intelligence, and the Future of the Human Mind. Simon & Schuster. 2007.
  • Moody, Raymond. Life After Life. Rider. 2001.
  • Moravec, Hans. Robot: Mere Machine to Transcendent Mind. Oxford University Press. 2003.
  • Noonan, Harold. Personal Identity. Routledge. 2003.
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Author Information

Gabriel Andrade
La Universidad del Zulia

Sigmund Freud (1856—1939)

freudSigmund Freud, the father of psychoanalysis, was a physiologist, medical doctor, psychologist and influential thinker of the early twentieth century. Working initially in close collaboration with Joseph Breuer, Freud elaborated the theory that the mind is a complex energy-system, the structural investigation of which is the proper province of psychology. He articulated and refined the concepts of the unconscious, infantile sexuality and repression, and he proposed a tripartite account of the mind’s structure—all as part of a radically new conceptual and therapeutic frame of reference for the understanding of human psychological development and the treatment of abnormal mental conditions. Notwithstanding the multiple manifestations of psychoanalysis as it exists today, it can in almost all fundamental respects be traced directly back to Freud’s original work.

Freud’s innovative treatment of human actions, dreams, and indeed of cultural artifacts as invariably possessing implicit symbolic significance has proven to be extraordinarily fruitful, and has had massive implications for a wide variety of fields including psychology, anthropology, semiotics, and artistic creativity and appreciation. However, Freud’s most important and frequently re-iterated claim, that with psychoanalysis he had invented a successful science of the mind, remains the subject of much critical debate and controversy.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Backdrop to His Thought
  3. The Theory of the Unconscious
  4. Infantile Sexuality
  5. Neuroses and The Structure of the Mind
  6. Psychoanalysis as a Therapy
  7. Critical Evaluation of Freud
    1. The Claim to Scientific Status
    2. The Coherence of the Theory
    3. Freud's Discovery
    4. The Efficacy of Psychoanalytic Therapy
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Freud
    2. Works on Freud and Freudian Psychoanalysis

1. Life

Freud was born in Frieberg, Moravia in 1856, but when he was four years old his family moved to Vienna where he was to live and work until the last years of his life. In 1938 the Nazis annexed Austria, and Freud, who was Jewish, was allowed to leave for England. For these reasons, it was above all with the city of Vienna that Freud’s name was destined to be deeply associated for posterity, founding as he did what was to become known as the ‘first Viennese school’ of psychoanalysis from which flowed psychoanalysis as a movement and all subsequent developments in this field. The scope of Freud’s interests, and of his professional training, was very broad. He always considered himself first and foremost a scientist, endeavoring to extend the compass of human knowledge, and to this end (rather than to the practice of medicine) he enrolled at the medical school at the University of Vienna in 1873. He concentrated initially on biology, doing research in physiology for six years under the great German scientist Ernst Brücke, who was director of the Physiology Laboratory at the University, and thereafter specializing in neurology. He received his medical degree in 1881, and having become engaged to be married in 1882, he rather reluctantly took up more secure and financially rewarding work as a doctor at Vienna General Hospital. Shortly after his marriage in 1886, which was extremely happy and gave Freud six children—the youngest of whom, Anna, was to herself become a distinguished psychoanalyst—Freud set up a private practice in the treatment of psychological disorders, which gave him much of the clinical material that he based his theories and pioneering techniques on.

In 1885-86, Freud spent the greater part of a year in Paris, where he was deeply impressed by the work of the French neurologist Jean Charcot who was at that time using hypnotism to treat hysteria and other abnormal mental conditions. When he returned to Vienna, Freud experimented with hypnosis but found that its beneficial effects did not last. At this point he decided to adopt instead a method suggested by the work of an older Viennese colleague and friend, Josef Breuer, who had discovered that when he encouraged a hysterical patient to talk uninhibitedly about the earliest occurrences of the symptoms, they sometimes gradually abated. Working with Breuer, Freud formulated and developed the idea that many neuroses (phobias, hysterical paralysis and pains, some forms of paranoia, and so forth) had their origins in deeply traumatic experiences which had occurred in the patient’s past but which were now forgotten–hidden from consciousness. The treatment was to enable the patient to recall the experience to consciousness, to confront it in a deep way both intellectually and emotionally, and in thus discharging it, to remove the underlying psychological causes of the neurotic symptoms. This technique, and the theory from which it is derived, was given its classical expression in Studies in Hysteria, jointly published by Freud and Breuer in 1895.

Shortly thereafter, however, Breuer found that he could not agree with what he regarded as the excessive emphasis which Freud placed upon the sexual origins and content of neuroses, and the two parted company, with Freud continuing to work alone to develop and refine the theory and practice of psychoanalysis. In 1900, after a protracted period of self-analysis, he published The Interpretation of Dreams, which is generally regarded as his greatest work. This was followed in 1901 by The Psychopathology of Everyday Life; and in 1905 by Three Essays on the Theory of Sexuality. Freud’s psychoanalytic theory was initially not well received–when its existence was acknowledged at all it was usually by people who were, as Breuer had foreseen, scandalized by the emphasis placed on sexuality by Freud. It was not until 1908, when the first International Psychoanalytical Congress was held at Salzburg that Freud’s importance began to be generally recognized. This was greatly facilitated in 1909, when he was invited to give a course of lectures in the United States, which were to form the basis of his 1916 book Five Lectures on Psycho-Analysis. From this point on Freud’s reputation and fame grew enormously, and he continued to write prolifically until his death, producing in all more than twenty volumes of theoretical works and clinical studies. He was also not averse to critically revising his views, or to making fundamental alterations to his most basic principles when he considered that the scientific evidence demanded it–this was most clearly evidenced by his advancement of a completely new tripartite (id, ego, and super-ego) model of the mind in his 1923 work The Ego and the Id. He was initially greatly heartened by attracting followers of the intellectual caliber of Adler and Jung, and was correspondingly disappointed when they both went on to found rival schools of psychoanalysis–thus giving rise to the first two of many schisms in the movement–but he knew that such disagreement over basic principles had been part of the early development of every new science. After a life of remarkable vigor and creative productivity, he died of cancer while exiled in England in 1939.

2. Backdrop to His Thought

Although a highly original thinker, Freud was also deeply influenced by a number of diverse factors which overlapped and interconnected with each other to shape the development of his thought. As indicated above, both Charcot and Breuer had a direct and immediate impact upon him, but some of the other factors, though no less important than these, were of a rather different nature. First of all, Freud himself was very much a Freudian–his father had two sons by a previous marriage, Emmanuel and Philip, and the young Freud often played with Philip’s son John, who was his own age. Freud’s self-analysis, which forms the core of his masterpiece The Interpretation of Dreams, originated in the emotional crisis which he suffered on the death of his father and the series of dreams to which this gave rise. This analysis revealed to him that the love and admiration which he had felt for his father were mixed with very contrasting feelings of shame and hate (such a mixed attitude he termed ‘ambivalence’). Particularly revealing was his discovery that he had often fantasized as a youth that his half-brother Philip (who was of an age with his mother) was really his father, and certain other signs convinced him of the deep underlying meaning of this fantasy–that he had wished his real father dead because he was his rival for his mother’s affections. This was to become the personal (though by no means exclusive) basis for his theory of the Oedipus complex.

Secondly, and at a more general level, account must be taken of the contemporary scientific climate in which Freud lived and worked. In most respects, the towering scientific figure of nineteenth century science was Charles Darwin, who had published his revolutionary Origin of Species when Freud was four years old. The evolutionary doctrine radically altered the prevailing conception of man–whereas before, man had been seen as a being different in nature from the members of the animal kingdom by virtue of his possession of an immortal soul, he was now seen as being part of the natural order, different from non-human animals only in degree of structural complexity. This made it possible and plausible, for the first time, to treat man as an object of scientific investigation, and to conceive of the vast and varied range of human behavior, and the motivational causes from which it springs, as being amenable in principle to scientific explanation. Much of the creative work done in a whole variety of diverse scientific fields over the next century was to be inspired by, and derive sustenance from, this new world-view, which Freud with his enormous esteem for science, accepted implicitly.

An even more important influence on Freud however, came from the field of physics. The second fifty years of the nineteenth century saw monumental advances in contemporary physics, which were largely initiated by the formulation of the principle of the conservation of energy by Helmholz. This principle states, in effect, that the total amount of energy in any given physical system is always constant, that energy quanta can be changed but not annihilated, and that consequently when energy is moved from one part of the system, it must reappear in another part. The progressive application of this principle led to monumental discoveries in the fields of thermodynamics, electromagnetism and nuclear physics which, with their associated technologies, have so comprehensively transformed the contemporary world. As we have seen, when he first came to the University of Vienna, Freud worked under the direction of Ernst Brücke who in 1874 published a book setting out the view that all living organisms, including humans, are essentially energy-systems to which, no less than to inanimate objects, the principle of the conservation of energy applies. Freud, who had great admiration and respect for Brücke, quickly adopted this new "dynamic physiology" with enthusiasm. From there it was but a short conceptual step—but one which Freud was the first to take, and on which his claim to fame is largely grounded—to the view that there is such a thing as "psychic energy," that the human personality is also an energy-system, and that it is the function of psychology to investigate the modifications, transmissions and conversions of psychic energy within the personality which shape and determine it. This latter conception is the very cornerstone of Freud’s psychoanalytic theory.

3. The Theory of the Unconscious

Freud’s theory of the unconscious, then, is highly deterministic—a fact which, given the nature of nineteenth century science, should not be surprising. Freud was arguably the first thinker to apply deterministic principles systematically to the sphere of the mental, and to hold that the broad spectrum of human behavior is explicable only in terms of the (usually hidden) mental processes or states which determine it. Thus, instead of treating the behavior of the neurotic as being causally inexplicable—which had been the prevailing approach for centuries—Freud insisted, on the contrary, on treating it as behavior for which it is meaningful to seek an explanation by searching for causes in terms of the mental states of the individual concerned. Hence the significance which he attributed to slips of the tongue or pen, obsessive behavior and dreams—all these, he held, are determined by hidden causes in the person’s mind, and so they reveal in covert form what would otherwise not be known at all. This suggests the view that freedom of the will is, if not completely an illusion, certainly more tightly circumscribed than is commonly believed, for it follows from this that whenever we make a choice we are governed by hidden mental processes of which we are unaware and over which we have no control.

The postulate that there are such things as unconscious mental states at all is a direct function of Freud’s determinism, his reasoning here being simply that the principle of causality requires that such mental states should exist, for it is evident that there is frequently nothing in the conscious mind which can be said to cause neurotic or other behavior. An ‘unconscious’ mental process or event, for Freud, is not one which merely happens to be out of consciousness at a given time, but is rather one which cannot, except through protracted psychoanalysis, be brought to the forefront of consciousness. The postulation of such unconscious mental states entails, of course, that the mind is not, and cannot be, either identified with consciousness, or an object of consciousness. To employ a much-used analogy, it is rather structurally akin to an iceberg, the bulk of it lying below the surface, exerting a dynamic and determining influence upon the part which is amenable to direct inspection—the conscious mind.

Deeply associated with this view of the mind is Freud’s account of instincts or drives. Instincts, for Freud, are the principal motivating forces in the mental realm, and as such they ‘energise’ the mind in all of its functions. There are, he held, an indefinitely large number of such instincts, but these can be reduced to a small number of basic ones, which he grouped into two broad generic categories, Eros (the life instinct), which covers all the self-preserving and erotic instincts, and Thanatos (the death instinct), which covers all the instincts towards aggression, self-destruction, and cruelty. Thus it is a mistake to interpret Freud as asserting that all human actions spring from motivations which are sexual in their origin, since those which derive from Thanatos are not sexually motivated–indeed, Thanatos is the irrational urge to destroy the source of all sexual energy in the annihilation of the self. Having said that, it is undeniably true that Freud gave sexual drives an importance and centrality in human life, human actions, and human behavior which was new (and to many, shocking), arguing as he does that sexual drives exist and can be discerned in children from birth (the theory of infantile sexuality), and that sexual energy (libido) is the single most important motivating force in adult life. However, a crucial qualification has to be added here—Freud effectively redefined the term "sexuality" to make it cover any form of pleasure which is or can be derived from the body. Thus his theory of the instincts or drives is essentially that the human being is energized or driven from birth by the desire to acquire and enhance bodily pleasure.

4. Infantile Sexuality

Freud’s theory of infantile sexuality must be seen as an integral part of a broader developmental theory of human personality. This had its origins in, and was a generalization of, Breuer’s earlier discovery that traumatic childhood events could have devastating negative effects upon the adult individual, and took the form of the general thesis that early childhood sexual experiences were the crucial factors in the determination of the adult personality. From his account of the instincts or drives it followed that from the moment of birth the infant is driven in his actions by the desire for bodily/sexual pleasure, where this is seen by Freud in almost mechanical terms as the desire to release mental energy. Initially, infants gain such release, and derive such pleasure, from the act of sucking. Freud accordingly terms this the "oral" stage of development. This is followed by a stage in which the locus of pleasure or energy release is the anus, particularly in the act of defecation, and this is accordingly termed the ‘anal’ stage. Then the young child develops an interest in its sexual organs as a site of pleasure (the "phallic" stage), and develops a deep sexual attraction for the parent of the opposite sex, and a hatred of the parent of the same sex (the "Oedipus complex"). This, however, gives rise to (socially derived) feelings of guilt in the child, who recognizes that it can never supplant the stronger parent. A male child also perceives himself to be at risk. He fears that if he persists in pursuing the sexual attraction for his mother, he may be harmed by the father; specifically, he comes to fear that he may be castrated. This is termed "castration anxiety." Both the attraction for the mother and the hatred are usually repressed, and the child usually resolves the conflict of the Oedipus complex by coming to identify with the parent of the same sex. This happens at the age of five, whereupon the child enters a "latency" period, in which sexual motivations become much less pronounced. This lasts until puberty when mature genital development begins, and the pleasure drive refocuses around the genital area.

This, Freud believed, is the sequence or progression implicit in normal human development, and it is to be observed that at the infant level the instinctual attempts to satisfy the pleasure drive are frequently checked by parental control and social coercion. The developmental process, then, is for the child essentially a movement through a series of conflicts, the successful resolution of which is crucial to adult mental health. Many mental illnesses, particularly hysteria, Freud held, can be traced back to unresolved conflicts experienced at this stage, or to events which otherwise disrupt the normal pattern of infantile development. For example, homosexuality is seen by some Freudians as resulting from a failure to resolve the conflicts of the Oedipus complex, particularly a failure to identify with the parent of the same sex; the obsessive concern with washing and personal hygiene which characterizes the behavior of some neurotics is seen as resulting from unresolved conflicts/repressions occurring at the anal stage.

5. Neuroses and The Structure of the Mind

Freud’s account of the unconscious, and the psychoanalytic therapy associated with it, is best illustrated by his famous tripartite model of the structure of the mind or personality (although, as we have seen, he did not formulate this until 1923). This model has many points of similarity with the account of the mind offered by Plato over 2,000 years earlier. The theory is termed ‘tripartite’ simply because, again like Plato, Freud distinguished three structural elements within the mind, which he called id, ego, and super-ego. The id is that part of the mind in which are situated the instinctual sexual drives which require satisfaction; the super-ego is that part which contains the "conscience," namely, socially-acquired control mechanisms which have been internalized, and which are usually imparted in the first instance by the parents; while the ego is the conscious self that is created by the dynamic tensions and interactions between the id and the super-ego and has the task of reconciling their conflicting demands with the requirements of external reality. It is in this sense that the mind is to be understood as a dynamic energy-system. All objects of consciousness reside in the ego; the contents of the id belong permanently to the unconscious mind; while the super-ego is an unconscious screening-mechanism which seeks to limit the blind pleasure-seeking drives of the id by the imposition of restrictive rules. There is some debate as to how literally Freud intended this model to be taken (he appears to have taken it extremely literally himself), but it is important to note that what is being offered here is indeed a theoretical model rather than a description of an observable object, which functions as a frame of reference to explain the link between early childhood experience and the mature adult (normal or dysfunctional) personality.

Freud also followed Plato in his account of the nature of mental health or psychological well-being, which he saw as the establishment of a harmonious relationship between the three elements which constitute the mind. If the external world offers no scope for the satisfaction of the id’s pleasure drives, or more commonly, if the satisfaction of some or all of these drives would indeed transgress the moral sanctions laid down by the super-ego, then an inner conflict occurs in the mind between its constituent parts or elements. Failure to resolve this can lead to later neurosis. A key concept introduced here by Freud is that the mind possesses a number of ‘defense mechanisms’ to attempt to prevent conflicts from becoming too acute, such as repression (pushing conflicts back into the unconscious), sublimation (channeling the sexual drives into the achievement socially acceptable goals, in art, science, poetry, and so forth), fixation (the failure to progress beyond one of the developmental stages), and regression (a return to the behavior characteristic of one of the stages).

Of these, repression is the most important, and Freud’s account of this is as follows: when a person experiences an instinctual impulse to behave in a manner which the super-ego deems to be reprehensible (for example, a strong erotic impulse on the part of the child towards the parent of the opposite sex), then it is possible for the mind to push this impulse away, to repress it into the unconscious. Repression is thus one of the central defense mechanisms by which the ego seeks to avoid internal conflict and pain, and to reconcile reality with the demands of both id and super-ego. As such it is completely normal and an integral part of the developmental process through which every child must pass on the way to adulthood. However, the repressed instinctual drive, as an energy-form, is not and cannot be destroyed when it is repressed–it continues to exist intact in the unconscious, from where it exerts a determining force upon the conscious mind, and can give rise to the dysfunctional behavior characteristic of neuroses. This is one reason why dreams and slips of the tongue possess such a strong symbolic significance for Freud, and why their analysis became such a key part of his treatment–they represent instances in which the vigilance of the super-ego is relaxed, and when the repressed drives are accordingly able to present themselves to the conscious mind in a transmuted form. The difference between ‘normal’ repression and the kind of repression which results in neurotic illness is one of degree, not of kind–the compulsive behavior of the neurotic is itself a manifestation of an instinctual drive repressed in childhood. Such behavioral symptoms are highly irrational (and may even be perceived as such by the neurotic), but are completely beyond the control of the subject because they are driven by the now unconscious repressed impulse. Freud positioned the key repressions for both, the normal individual and the neurotic, in the first five years of childhood, and of course, held them to be essentially sexual in nature;–since, as we have seen, repressions which disrupt the process of infantile sexual development in particular, according to him, lead to a strong tendency to later neurosis in adult life. The task of psychoanalysis as a therapy is to find the repressions which cause the neurotic symptoms by delving into the unconscious mind of the subject, and by bringing them to the forefront of consciousness, to allow the ego to confront them directly and thus to discharge them.

6. Psychoanalysis as a Therapy

Freud’s account of the sexual genesis and nature of neuroses led him naturally to develop a clinical treatment for treating such disorders. This has become so influential today that when people speak of psychoanalysis they frequently refer exclusively to the clinical treatment; however, the term properly designates both the clinical treatment and the theory which underlies it. The aim of the method may be stated simply in general terms–to re-establish a harmonious relationship between the three elements which constitute the mind by excavating and resolving unconscious repressed conflicts. The actual method of treatment pioneered by Freud grew out of Breuer’s earlier discovery, mentioned above, that when a hysterical patient was encouraged to talk freely about the earliest occurrences of her symptoms and fantasies, the symptoms began to abate, and were eliminated entirely when she was induced to remember the initial trauma which occasioned them. Turning away from his early attempts to explore the unconscious through hypnosis, Freud further developed this "talking cure," acting on the assumption that the repressed conflicts were buried in the deepest recesses of the unconscious mind. Accordingly, he got his patients to relax in a position in which they were deprived of strong sensory stimulation, and even keen awareness of the presence of the analyst (hence the famous use of the couch, with the analyst virtually silent and out of sight), and then encouraged them to speak freely and uninhibitedly, preferably without forethought, in the belief that he could thereby discern the unconscious forces lying behind what was said. This is the method of free-association, the rationale for which is similar to that involved in the analysis of dreams—in both cases the super-ego is to some degree disarmed, its efficiency as a screening mechanism is moderated, and material is allowed to filter through to the conscious ego which would otherwise be completely repressed. The process is necessarily a difficult and protracted one, and it is therefore one of the primary tasks of the analyst to help the patient recognize, and overcome, his own natural resistances, which may exhibit themselves as hostility towards the analyst. However, Freud always took the occurrence of resistance as a sign that he was on the right track in his assessment of the underlying unconscious causes of the patient’s condition. The patient’s dreams are of particular interest, for reasons which we have already partly seen. Taking it that the super-ego functioned less effectively in sleep, as in free association, Freud made a distinction between the manifest content of a dream (what the dream appeared to be about on the surface) and its latent content (the unconscious, repressed desires or wishes which are its real object). The correct interpretation of the patient’s dreams, slips of tongue, free-associations, and responses to carefully selected questions leads the analyst to a point where he can locate the unconscious repressions producing the neurotic symptoms, invariably in terms of the patient’s passage through the sexual developmental process, the manner in which the conflicts implicit in this process were handled, and the libidinal content of the patient’s family relationships. To effect a cure, the analyst must facilitate the patient himself to become conscious of unresolved conflicts buried in the deep recesses of the unconscious mind, and to confront and engage with them directly.

In this sense, then, the object of psychoanalytic treatment may be said to be a form of self-understanding–once this is acquired it is largely up to the patient, in consultation with the analyst, to determine how he shall handle this newly-acquired understanding of the unconscious forces which motivate him. One possibility, mentioned above, is the channeling of sexual energy into the achievement of social, artistic or scientific goals–this is sublimation, which Freud saw as the motivating force behind most great cultural achievements. Another possibility would be the conscious, rational control of formerly repressed drives–this is suppression. Yet another would be the decision that it is the super-ego and the social constraints which inform it that are at fault, in which case the patient may decide in the end to satisfy the instinctual drives. But in all cases the cure is effected essentially by a kind of catharsis or purgation–a release of the pent-up psychic energy, the constriction of which was the basic cause of the neurotic illness.

7. Critical Evaluation of Freud

It should be evident from the foregoing why psychoanalysis in general, and Freud in particular, have exerted such a strong influence upon the popular imagination in the Western World, and why both the theory and practice of psychoanalysis should remain the object of a great deal of controversy. In fact, the controversy which exists in relation to Freud is more heated and multi-faceted than that relating to virtually any other post-1850 thinker (a possible exception being Darwin), with criticisms ranging from the contention that Freud’s theory was generated by logical confusions arising out of his alleged long-standing addiction to cocaine (see Thornton, E.M. Freud and Cocaine: The Freudian Fallacy) to the view that he made an important, but grim, empirical discovery, which he knowingly suppressed in favour of the theory of the unconscious, knowing that the latter would be more socially acceptable (see Masson, J. The Assault on Truth).

It should be emphasized here that Freud’s genius is not (generally) in doubt, but the precise nature of his achievement is still the source of much debate. The supporters and followers of Freud (and Jung and Adler) are noted for the zeal and enthusiasm with which they espouse the doctrines of the master, to the point where many of the detractors of the movement see it as a kind of secular religion, requiring as it does an initiation process in which the aspiring psychoanalyst must himself first be analyzed. In this way, it is often alleged, the unquestioning acceptance of a set of ideological principles becomes a necessary precondition for acceptance into the movement–as with most religious groupings. In reply, the exponents and supporters of psychoanalysis frequently analyze the motivations of their critics in terms of the very theory which those critics reject. And so the debate goes on.

Here we will confine ourselves to: (a) the evaluation of Freud’s claim that his theory is a scientific one, (b) the question of the theory’s coherence, (c) the dispute concerning what, if anything, Freud really discovered, and (d) the question of the efficacy of psychoanalysis as a treatment for neurotic illnesses.

a. The Claim to Scientific Status

This is a crucially important issue since Freud saw himself first and foremost as a pioneering scientist, and repeatedly asserted that the significance of psychoanalysis is that it is a new science, incorporating a new scientific method of dealing with the mind and with mental illness. There can, moreover, be no doubt but that this has been the chief attraction of the theory for most of its advocates since then–on the face of it, it has the appearance of being not just a scientific theory but an enormously strong one, with the capacity to accommodate, and explain, every possible form of human behavior. However, it is precisely this latter which, for many commentators, undermines its claim to scientific status. On the question of what makes a theory a genuinely scientific one, Karl Popper’s criterion of demarcation, as it is called, has now gained very general acceptance: namely, that every genuine scientific theory must be testable, and therefore falsifiable, at least in principle. In other words, if a theory is incompatible with possible observations, it is scientific; conversely, a theory which is compatible with all possible observations is unscientific (see Popper, K. The Logic of Scientific Discovery). Thus the principle of the conservation of energy (physical, not psychic), which influenced Freud so greatly, is a scientific one because it is falsifiable–the discovery of a physical system in which the total amount of physical energy was not constant would conclusively show it to be false. It is argued that nothing of the kind is possible with respect to Freud’s theory–it is not falsifiable. If the question is asked: "What does this theory imply which, if false, would show the whole theory to be false?," the answer is "Nothing" because the theory is compatible with every possible state of affairs. Hence it is concluded that the theory is not scientific, and while this does not, as some critics claim, rob it of all value, it certainly diminishes its intellectual status as projected by its strongest advocates, including Freud himself.

b. The Coherence of the Theory

A related (but perhaps more serious) point is that the coherence of the theory is, at the very least, questionable. What is attractive about the theory, even to the layman, is that it seems to offer us long sought-after and much needed causal explanations for conditions which have been a source of a great deal of human misery. The thesis that neuroses are caused by unconscious conflicts buried deep in the unconscious mind in the form of repressed libidinal energy would appear to offer us, at last, an insight in the causal mechanism underlying these abnormal psychological conditions as they are expressed in human behavior, and further show us how they are related to the psychology of the ‘normal’ person. However, even this is questionable, and is a matter of much dispute. In general, when it is said that an event X causes another event Y to happen, both X and Y are, and must be, independently identifiable. It is true that this is not always a simple process, as in science causes are sometimes unobservable (sub-atomic particles, radio and electromagnetic waves, molecular structures, and so forth), but in these latter cases there are clear ‘correspondence rules’ connecting the unobservable causes with observable phenomena. The difficulty with Freud’s theory is that it offers us entities (for example repressed unconscious conflicts), which are said to be the unobservable causes of certain forms of behavior But there are no correspondence rules for these alleged causes–they cannot be identified except by reference to the behavior which they are said to cause (that is, the analyst does not demonstratively assert: "This is the unconscious cause, and that is its behavioral effect;" rather he asserts: "This is the behavior, therefore its unconscious cause must exist"), and this does raise serious doubts as to whether Freud’s theory offers us genuine causal explanations at all.

c. Freud's Discovery?

At a less theoretical, but no less critical level, it has been alleged that Freud did make a genuine discovery which he was initially prepared to reveal to the world. However, the response he encountered was so ferociously hostile that he masked his findings and offered his theory of the unconscious in its place (see Masson, J. The Assault on Truth). What he discovered, it has been suggested, was the extreme prevalence of child sexual abuse, particularly of young girls (the vast majority of hysterics are women), even in respectable nineteenth century Vienna. He did in fact offer an early "seduction theory" of neuroses, which met with fierce animosity, and which he quickly withdrew and replaced with the theory of the unconscious. As one contemporary Freudian commentator explains it, Freud’s change of mind on this issue came about as follows:

Questions concerning the traumas suffered by his patients seemed to reveal [to Freud] that Viennese girls were extraordinarily often seduced in very early childhood by older male relatives. Doubt about the actual occurrence of these seductions was soon replaced by certainty that it was descriptions about childhood fantasy that were being offered. (MacIntyre).

In this way, it is suggested, the theory of the Oedipus complex was generated.

This statement begs a number of questions, not least, what does the expression ‘extraordinarily often’ mean in this context? By what standard is this being judged? The answer can only be: By the standard of what we generally believe–or would like to believe–to be the case. But the contention of some of Freud’s critics here is that his patients were not recalling childhood fantasies, but traumatic events from their childhood which were all too real. Freud, according to them, had stumbled upon and knowingly suppressed the fact that the level of child sexual abuse in society is much higher than is generally believed or acknowledged. If this contention is true–and it must at least be contemplated seriously–then this is undoubtedly the most serious criticism that Freud and his followers have to face.

Further, this particular point has taken on an added and even more controversial significance in recent years, with the willingness of some contemporary Freudians to combine the theory of repression with an acceptance of the wide-spread social prevalence of child sexual abuse. The result has been that in the United States and Britain in particular, many thousands of people have emerged from analysis with ‘recovered memories’ of alleged childhood sexual abuse by their parents; memories which, it is suggested, were hitherto repressed. On this basis, parents have been accused and repudiated, and whole families have been divided or destroyed. Unsurprisingly, this in turn has given rise to a systematic backlash in which organizations of accused parents, seeing themselves as the true victims of what they term ‘False Memory Syndrome’, have denounced all such memory-claims as falsidical – the direct product of a belief in what they see as the myth of repression. (see Pendergast, M. Victims of Memory). In this way, the concept of repression, which Freud himself termed "the foundation stone upon which the structure of psychoanalysis rests," has come in for more widespread critical scrutiny than ever before. Here, the fact that, unlike some of his contemporary followers, Freud did not himself ever countenance the extension of the concept of repression to cover actual child sexual abuse, and the fact that we are not necessarily forced to choose between the views that all "recovered memories" are either veridical or falsidical are, perhaps understandably, frequently lost sight of in the extreme heat generated by this debate.

d. The Efficacy of Psychoanalytic Therapy

It does not follow that, if Freud’s theory is unscientific, or even false, it cannot provide us with a basis for the beneficial treatment of neurotic illness because the relationship between a theory’s truth or falsity and its utility-value is far from being an isomorphic one. (The theory upon which the use of leeches to bleed patients in eighteenth century medicine was based was quite spurious, but patients did sometimes actually benefit from the treatment!). And of course even a true theory might be badly applied, leading to negative consequences. One of the problems here is that it is difficult to specify what counts as a cure for a neurotic illness as distinct, say, from a mere alleviation of the symptoms. In general, however, the efficiency of a given method of treatment is usually clinically measured by means of a control group–the proportion of patients suffering from a given disorder who are cured by treatment X is measured by comparison with those cured by other treatments, or by no treatment at all. Such clinical tests as have been conducted indicate that the proportion of patients who have benefited from psychoanalytic treatment does not diverge significantly from the proportion who recover spontaneously or as a result of other forms of intervention in the control groups used. So, the question of the therapeutic effectiveness of psychoanalysis remains an open and controversial one.

8. References and Further Reading

a. Works by Freud

  • The Standard Edition of the Complete Psychological Works of Sigmund Freud (Ed. J. Strachey with Anna Freud), 24 vols. London: 1953-1964.

b. Works on Freud and Freudian Psychoanalysis

  • Abramson, J.B. Liberation and Its Limits: The Moral and Political Thought of Freud. New York: Free Press, 1984.
  • Bettlelheim, B. Freud and Man’s Soul. Knopf, 1982.
  • Cavell, M. The Psychoanalytic Mind: From Freud to Philosophy. Harvard University Press, 1993.
  • Cavell, M. Becoming a Subject: Reflections in Philosophy and Psychoanalysis. New York:  Oxford University Press, 2006.
  • Chessick, R.D. Freud Teaches Psychotherapy. Hackett Publishing Company, 1980.
  • Cioffi, F. (ed.) Freud: Modern Judgements. Macmillan, 1973.
  • Deigh, J. The Sources of Moral Agency: Essays in Moral Psychology and Freudian Theory. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Dilman, I. Freud and Human Nature. Blackwell, 1983
  • Dilman, I. Freud and the Mind. Blackwell, 1984.
  • Edelson, M. Hypothesis and Evidence in Psychoanalysis. University of Chicago Press, 1984.
  • Erwin, E. A Final Accounting: Philosophical and Empirical Issues in Freudian Psychology. MIT Press, 1996.
  • Fancher, R. Psychoanalytic Psychology: The Development of Freud’s Thought. Norton, 1973.
  • Farrell, B.A. The Standing of Psychoanalysis. Oxford University Press, 1981.
  • Fingarette, H. The Self in Transformation: Psychoanalysis, Philosophy, and the Life of the Spirit. HarperCollins, 1977.
  • Freeman, L. The Story of Anna O.–The Woman who led Freud to Psychoanalysis. Paragon House, 1990.
  • Frosh, S. The Politics of Psychoanalysis: An Introduction to Freudian and Post-Freudian Theory. Yale University Press, 1987.
  • Gardner, S. Irrationality and the Philosophy of Psychoanalysis. Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Grünbaum, A. The Foundations of Psychoanalysis: A Philosophical Critique. University of California Press, 1984.
  • Gay, V.P. Freud on Sublimation: Reconsiderations. Albany, NY: State University Press, 1992.
  • Hook, S. (ed.) Psychoanalysis, Scientific Method, and Philosophy. New York University Press, 1959.
  • Jones, E. Sigmund Freud: Life and Work (3 vols), Basic Books, 1953-1957.
  • Klein, G.S. Psychoanalytic Theory: An Exploration of Essentials. International Universities Press, 1976.
  • Lear, J. Love and Its Place in Nature: A Philosophical Interpretation of Freudian Psychoanalysis. Farrar, Straus & Giroux, 1990.
  • Lear, J. Open Minded: Working Out the Logic of the Soul. Cambridge, Harvard University Press, 1998.
  • Lear, Jonathan. Happiness, Death, and the Remainder of Life. Harvard University Press, 2000.
  • Lear, Jonathan. Freud. Routledge, 2005.
  • Levine, M.P. (ed). The Analytic Freud: Philosophy and Psychoanalysis. London: Routledge, 2000.
  • Levy, D. Freud Among the Philosophers: The Psychoanalytic Unconscious and Its Philosophical Critics. New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1996.
  • MacIntyre, A.C. The Unconscious: A Conceptual Analysis. Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1958.
  • Mahony, P.J. Freud’s Dora: A Psychoanalytic, Historical and Textual Study. Yale University Press, 1996.
  • Masson, J. The Assault on Truth: Freud’s Suppression of the Seduction Theory. Faber & Faber, 1984.
  • Neu, J. (ed). The Cambridge Companion to Freud. Cambridge          University Press, 1994.
  • O’Neill, J. (ed). Freud and the Passions. Pennsylvania State University Press, 2004.
  • Popper, K. The Logic of Scientific Discovery. Hutchinson, 1959.
  • Pendergast, M. Victims of Memory. HarperCollins, 1997.
  • Reiser, M. Mind, Brain, Body: Towards a Convergence of Psychoanalysis and Neurobiology. Basic Books, 1984.
  • Ricoeur, P. Freud and Philosophy: An Essay in Interpretation (trans. D. Savage). Yale University Press, 1970.
  • Robinson, P. Freud and His Critics. Berkeley, University of California Press, 1993.
  • Rose, J. On Not Being Able to Sleep: Psychoanalysis and the Modern World. Princeton University Press, 2003.
  • Roth, P. The Superego. Icon Books, 2001.
  • Rudnytsky, P.L. Freud and Oedipus. Columbia University Press, 1987.
  • Said, E.W. Freud and the Non-European. Verso (in association with the Freud Museum, London), 2003.
  • Schafer, R. A New Language for Psychoanalysis. Yale University Press, 1976.
  • Sherwood, M. The Logic of Explanation in Psychoanalysis. Academic Press, 1969.
  • Smith, D.L. Freud’s Philosophy of the Unconscious. Kluwer, 1999.
  • Stewart, W. Psychoanalysis: The First Ten Years, 1888-1898. Macmillan, 1969.
  • Sulloway, F. Freud, Biologist of the Mind. Basic Books, 1979.
  • Thornton, E.M. Freud and Cocaine: The Freudian Fallacy. Blond & Briggs, 1983.
  • Tauber, A.I. Freud, the Reluctant Philosopher. Princeton University Press, 2010.
  • Wallace, E.R. Freud and Anthropology: A History and Reappraisal. International Universities Press, 1983.
  • Wallwork, E. Psychoanalysis and Ethics. Yale University Press, 1991.
  • Whitebrook, J. Perversion and Utopia: A Study in Psychoanalysis and Critical Theory. MIT Press, 1995.
  • Whyte, L.L. The Unconscious Before Freud. Basic Books, 1960.
  • Wollheim, R. Freud. Fontana, 1971.
  • Wollheim, R. (ed.) Freud: A Collection of Critical Essays. Anchor, 1974.
  • Wollheim, R. & Hopkins, J. (eds.) Philosophical Essays on Freud. Cambridge University Press, 1982.

See also the articles on Descartes' Mind-Body DistinctionHigher-Order Theories of Consciousness and Introspection.

Author Information

Stephen P. Thornton
University of Limerick

Relational Models Theory

Relational Models Theory is a theory in cognitive anthropology positing a biologically innate set of elementary mental models and a generative computational system operating upon those models.  The computational system produces compound models, using the elementary models as a kind of lexicon.  The resulting set of models is used in understanding, motivating, and evaluating social relationships and social structures.  The elementary models are intuitively quite simple and commonsensical.  They are as follows: Communal Sharing (having something in common), Authority Ranking (arrangement into a hierarchy), Equality Matching (striving to maintain egalitarian relationships), and Market Pricing (use of ratios).  Even though Relational Models Theory is classified as anthropology, it bears on several philosophical questions.

It contributes to value theory by describing a mental faculty which plays a crucial role in generating a plurality of values.  It thus shows how a single human nature can result in conflicting systems of value.  The theory also contributes to philosophy of cognition.  The complex models evidently result from a computational operation, thus supporting the view that a part of the mind functions computationally.  The theory contributes  to metaphysics.  Formal properties posited by the theory are perhaps best understood abstractly, raising the possibility that these mental models correspond to abstract objects.  If so, then Relational Models Theory reveals a Platonist ontology.

Table of Contents

  1. The Theory
    1. The Elementary Models
    2. Resemblance to Classic Measurement Scales
    3. Self-Organization and Natural Selection
    4. Compound Models
    5. Mods and Preos
  2. Philosophical Implications
    1. Moral Psychology
    2. Computational Conceptions of Cognition
    3. Platonism
  3. References
    1. Specifically Addressing Relational Models Theory
    2. Related Issues

1. The Theory

a. The Elementary Models

The anthropologist Alan Page Fiske pioneered Relational Models Theory (RMT).  RMT was originally conceived as a synthesis of certain constructs concerning norms formulated by Max Weber, Jean Piaget, and Paul Ricoeur.  Fiske then explored the theory among the Moose people of Burkina Faso in Africa.  He soon realized that its application was far more general, giving special insight into human nature.  According to RMT, humans are naturally social, using the relational models to structure and understand social interactions, the application of these models seen as intrinsically valuable. All relational models, no matter how complex, are, according to RMT, analyzable by four elementary models: Communal Sharing, Authority Ranking, Equality Matching, Market Pricing.

Any relationship informed by Communal Sharing presupposes a bounded group, the members of which are not differentiated from each other.  Distinguishing individual identities are socially irrelevant.  Generosity within a Communal Sharing group is not usually conceived of as altruism due to this shared identity, even though there is typically much behavior which otherwise would seem like extreme altruism.  Members of a Communal Sharing relationship typically feel that they share something in common, such as blood, deep attraction, national identity, a history of suffering, or the joy of food.  Examples include nationalism, racism, intense romantic love, indiscriminately killing any member of an enemy group in retaliation for the death of someone in one’s own group, sharing a meal.

An Authority Ranking relationship is a hierarchy in which individuals or groups are placed in relative higher or  lower relations .  Those ranked higher have prestige and privilege not enjoyed by those who are lower.  Further, the higher typically have some control over the actions of those who are lower.  However, the higher also have duties of protection and pastoral care for those beneath them.  Metaphors of spatial relation, temporal relation, and magnitude are typically used to distinguish people of different rank. For example, a King having a larger audience room than a Prince, or a King arriving after a Prince for a royal banquet.  Further examples include military rankings, the authority of parents over their children especially in more traditional societies, caste systems, and God’s authority over humankind.  Brute coercive manipulation is not considered to be Authority Ranking; it is more properly categorized as the Null Relation in which people treat each other in non-social ways.

In Equality Matching, one attempts to achieve and sustain an even balance and one-to-one correspondence between individuals or groups.  When there is not a perfect balance, people try to keep track of the degree of imbalance in order to calculate how much correction is needed.  “Equality matching is like using a pan balance: People know how to assemble actions on one side to equal any given weight on the other side” (Fiske 1992, 691).  If you and I are out of balance, we know what would restore equality.  Examples include the principle of one-person/one-vote, rotating credit associations, equal starting points in a race, taking turns offering dinner invitations, and giving an equal number of minutes to each candidate to deliver an on-air speech.

Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interaction.  This can involve maximization or minimization as in trying to maximize profit or minimize loss.  But it can also involve arriving at an intuitively fair proportion, as in a judge deciding on a punishment proportional to a crime.  In Market Pricing, all socially relevant properties of a relationship are reduced to a single measure of value, such as money or pleasure.  Most utilitarian principles involve maximization.  An exception would be Negative Utilitarianism whose principle is the minimization of suffering.  But all utilitarian principles are applications of Market Pricing, since the maximum and the minimum are both proportions.  Other examples include rents, taxes, cost-benefit analyses including military estimates of kill ratios and proportions of fighter planes potentially lost, tithing, and prostitution.

RMT has been extensively corroborated by controlled studies based on research using a great variety of methods investigating diverse phenomena, including cross-cultural studies (Haslam 2004b).  The research shows that the elementary models play an important role in cognition including perception of other persons.

b. Resemblance to Classic Measurement Scales

It may be jarring to learn that intense romantic love and racism are both categorized as Communal Sharing or that tithing and prostitution are both instances of Market Pricing.  These examples illustrate that a relational model is, at its core, a meaningless formal structure.  Implementation in interpersonal relations and attendant emotional associations enter in on a different level of mental processing.  Each model can be individuated in purely formal terms, each elementary model strongly resembling one of the classic scale types familiar from measurement theory.  (Strictly speaking, it is each mod which can be individuated in purely formal terms.  This finer point will be discussed in the next section.)

Communal Sharing resembles a nominal (categorical) scale.  A nominal scale is simply classifying things into categories.  A questionnaire may be designed to categorize people as theist, atheist, agnostic, and other.  Such a questionnaire is measuring religious belief by using a nominal scale.  The groups into which Communal Sharing sorts people is similar.  One either belongs to a pertinent group or one does not, there being no degree or any shades of gray.  Another illustration of nominal scaling is the pass/fail system of grading.  Authority Ranking resembles an ordinal scale in which items are ranked.  The ranking of students according to their performance is one example.  The ordered classification of shirts in a store as small, medium, large, and extra large is another.  Equality Matching resembles an interval scale.  On interval scales , any unit measures the same magnitude on any point in the scale.  For example, on the Celsius scale the difference between 1 degree and 2 degrees is the same as the difference between 5 degrees and 6 degrees.  Equality Matching resembles an interval scale insofar as one can measure the degree of inequality in a social relationship using equal intervals so as to judge how to correct the imbalance.  It is by use of such a scale that people in an Equality Matching interaction can specify how much one person owes another.  However, an interval scale cannot be used to express a ratio because it has no absolute zero point.  For example, the zero point on the Celsius scale is not absolute so one cannot say that 20 degrees is twice as warm as 10 degrees while on a Kelvin scale because the zero point is absolute one can express ratios.  Given that Market Pricing is the application of ratios to social interactions, it resembles a ratio scale such as the Kelvin scale.  One cannot, for example, meaningfully speak of the maximization of utility without presupposing some sort of ratio scale for measuring utility.  Maximization would correspond to 100 percent.

c. Self-Organization and Natural Selection

The four measurement scales correspond to different levels of semantic richness and precision.  The nominal scale conveys little information, being very coarse grained.  For example, pass/fail grading conveys less information than ranking students.  Giving letter grades is even more precise and semantically rich, conveying how much one student out-performs another.  This is the use of an interval scale.  The most informative and semantically rich is a percentage grade which illustrates the ratio by which one student out-performs another, hence a ratio scale.  For example, if graded accurately a student scoring 90 percent has done twice as well as a student scoring 45 percent.  Counterexamples may be apparent: two students could be ranked differently while receiving the same letter grade by using a deliberately coarse-grained letter grading system so as to minimize low grades.  To take an extreme case, a very generous instructor might award an A to every student (after all, no student was completely lost in class) while at the same time mentally ranking the students in terms of their performance.  Split grades are sometimes used to smooth out the traditional coarse-grained letter grading system .  But, if both scales are as sensitive as possible and based on the same data, the interval scale will convey more information than the ordinal scale.  The ordinal ranking will be derivable from the interval grading, but not vice versa.  This is more obvious in the case of temperature measurement, in which grade inflation is not an issue.  Simply ranking objects in terms of warmer/colder conveys less information than does Celsius measurement.

One scale is more informative than another because it is less symmetrical; greater asymmetry means that more information is conveyed.  On a measurement scale, a permutation which distorts or changes information is an asymmetry.  Analogously, a permutation in a social-relational arrangement which distorts or changes social relations is an asymmetry.  In either case, a permutation which does not carry with it such a distortion or change is symmetric.  The nominal scale type is the most symmetrical scale type, just as Communal Sharing is the most symmetrical elementary model.  In either case, the only asymmetrical permutation is one which moves an item out of a category, for example, expelling someone from the social group.  Any permutation within the category or group makes no difference; no difference to the information conveyed, no difference to the social relation.  In the case of pass/fail grading, the student’s performance could be markedly different from what it actually was.  So long as the student does well enough to pass (or poorly enough to fail), this would not have changed the grade.  Thanks to this high degree of symmetry, the nominal scale conveys relatively little information.

The ordinal scale is less symmetrical.  Any permutation that changes rankings is asymmetrical, since it distorts or changes something significant.  But items arranged could change in many respects relative to each other while their ordering remains unaffected, so a high level of symmetry remains.  Students could vary in their performance, but so long as their relative ranking remains the same, this would make no difference to grades based on an ordinal scale.

An interval scale is even less symmetrical and hence more informative, as seen in the fact that a system of letter grades conveys more information than does a mere ranking of students.  An interval scale conveys the relative degrees of difference between items.  If one student improves from doing C level work to B level work, this would register on an interval scale but would remain invisible on an ordinal scale if the change did not affect student ranking.  Analogously, in Equality Matching, if one person, and one person only, were to receive an extra five minutes to deliver their campaign speech, this would be socially significant.  By contrast, in Authority Ranking, the addition of an extra five minutes to the time taken by a Prince to deliver a speech would make no socially significant difference provided that the relative ranking remains undisturbed (for example, the King still being allotted more time than the Prince, and the Duke less than the Prince).

In Market Pricing, as in any ratio scale, the asymmetry is even greater.  Adding five years to the punishment of every convict could badly skew what should be proportionate punishments.  But giving an extra five minutes to each candidate would preserve balance in Equality Matching.

The symmetries of all the scale types have an interesting formal property.  They form a descending symmetry subgroup chain.  In other words, the symmetries of a ratio scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant interval scale, the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant ordinal scale, and the symmetries of that scale form a subset of the symmetries of a relevant nominal scale.  More specifically, the scale types form a containment hierarchy.  Analogously, the symmetries of Market Pricing form a subset of the symmetries of Equality Matching which form a subset of the symmetries of Authority Ranking which form a subset of the symmetries of Communal Sharing.  Descending subgroup chains are common in nature, including inorganic nature.  The symmetries of solid matter form a subset of the symmetries of liquid matter which form a subset of the symmetries of gaseous matter which form a subset of the symmetries of plasma.

This raises interesting questions about the origins of these patterns in the mind: could they result from spontaneous symmetry breakings in brain activity rather than being genetically encoded?  Darwinian adaptations are genetically encoded, whereas spontaneous symmetry breaking is ubiquitous in nature rather than being limited to genetically constrained structures.  The appeal to spontaneous symmetry breaking suggests a non-Darwinian approach to understanding how the elementary models could be “innate” (in the sense of being neither learned nor arrived at through reason).  That is, are the elementary relational models results of self-organization rather than learning or natural selection?  If they are programmed into the genome, why would this programming imitate a pattern in nature which usually occurs without genetic encoding?  The spiral shape of a galaxy, for example, is due to spontaneous symmetry breaking, as is the transition from liquid to solid.  But these transitions are not encoded in genes, of course.  Being part of the natural world, why should the elementary models be understood any differently?

d. Compound Models

While all relational models are analyzable into four fundamental models, the number of models as such is potentially infinite.  This is because social-relational cognition is productive; any instance of a model can serve as a constituent in an even more complex instance of a model.  Consider Authority Ranking and Market Pricing; an instance of one can be embedded in or subordinated to an instance of the other.  When a judge decides on a punishment that is proportionate to the crime, the judge is using a ratio scale and hence Market Pricing.  But the judge is only authorized to do this because of her authority, hence Authority Ranking.  We have here a case of Market Pricing embedded in a superordinate (as opposed to subordinate) structure of Authority Ranking resulting in a compound model.  Now consider ordering food from a waiter.  The superordinate relationship is now Market Pricing, since one is paying for the waiter’s service.  But the service itself is Authority Ranking with the customer as the superior party.  In this case, an instance of Authority Ranking is subordinate to an instance of Market Pricing.  This is also a compound model with the same constituents but differently arranged.  The democratic election of a leader is Authority Ranking subordinated to Equality Matching.  An elementary school teacher’s supervising children to make sure they take turns is Equality Matching subordinated to Authority Ranking.

A model can also be embedded in a model of the same type.  In some complex egalitarian social arrangements, one instance of Equality Matching can be embedded in another.  Anton Pannekoek’s proposed Council Communism is one such example.  The buying and selling of options is the buying and selling of the right to buy and sell, hence recursively embedded Market Pricing.  Moose society is largely structured by a complex model involving multiple levels of Communal Sharing.  A family among the Moose is largely structured by Communal Sharing, as is the village which embeds it, as is the larger community that embeds the village, and so on.  In principle, there is no upper limit on the number of embeddings in a compound model.  Hence, the number of potential relational models is infinite.

e. Mods and Preos

A model, whether elementary or compound, is devoid of meaning when considered in isolation.  As purely abstract structures, models are sometimes known as “mods” , which is an abbreviation of, “cognitively modular but modifiable modes of interacting” (Fiske 2004, 3).  (This may be a misnomer, since, as purely formal structures devoid of semantic content, mods are not modes of social interaction any more than syntax.   is a communication system.)  In order to externalize models, that is, in order to use them to interpret or motivate or structure interactions, one needs “preos,” these being “socially transmitted prototypes, precedents, and principles that complete the mods, specifying how, when and with respect to whom the mods apply” (2004, 4).  Strictly speaking, a relational model is the union of a mod with a preo.  A mod has the formal properties of symmetry, asymmetry, and in some cases embeddedness.  But a mod requires a preo in order to have the properties intuitively identifiable as meaningful, such as social application, emotional resonance, and motivating force.

The notion of a preo updates and includes the notion of an implementation rule, from an earlier stage of relational-models theorizing.  Fiske has identified five kinds of implementation rules (1991, 142).  One kind specifies the domain to which a model applies.  For example, in some cultures Authority Ranking is used to structure and give meaning to marriage.  In other cultures, Authority Ranking does not structure marriage and may even be viewed as immoral in that context.  Another sort of implementation rule specifies the individuals or groups which are to be related by the model.  Communal Sharing, for example, can be applied to different groups of people.  Experience, and sometimes also agreement, decides who is in the Communal Sharing group.  In implementing Authority Ranking, it is not enough to specify how many ranks there are.  One must also specify who belongs to which rank.  A third sort of implementation rule defines values and categories.  In Equality Matching, each participant must give or receive the same thing.  But what counts as the same thing?  In Authority Ranking, a higher-up deserves honor from a lower-down, but what counts as honor and what constitutes showing honor?  There are no a priori or innate answers to these questions; culture and mutual agreement help settle such matters.  Consider the principle of one-person/one-vote, an example of Equality Matching.  Currently in the United States and Great Britain, whoever gets the most votes wins the election.  But it is also possible to have a system in which a two-thirds majority is necessary for there to be a winner.  Without a two-thirds majority, there may be a coalition government, a second election with the lowest performing candidates eliminated, or some other arrangement.  These are different ways of determining what counts as treating each citizen as having an equal say.  A fourth determines the code used to indicate the existence and quality of the relationship.  Authority Ranking is coded differently in different cultures, as it can be represented by the size of one’s office, the height of one’s throne, the number of bars on one’s sleeve, and so forth.  A fifth sort of implementation rule concerns a general tendency to favor some elementary models over others.  For example, Market Pricing may be highly valued in some cultures as fair and reasonable while categorized as dehumanizing in others.  The same is clearly true of Authority Ranking.  Communal Sharing is much more prominent and generally valued in some cultures than in others.  This does not mean that any culture is completely devoid of any specific elementary model but that some models are de-emphasized and marginalized in some cultures as compared to others.  So the union of mod and preo may even serve to marginalize the resulting model in relation to other models.

The fact that the same mod can be united with different preos is one source of normative plurality across cultures, to be discussed in the next section.  Another source is the generation of distinct compound mods.  Different cultures can use different mods, since there is a considerable number of potential mods to choose from.

2. Philosophical Implications

a. Moral Psychology

Each elementary model crucially enters into certain moral values.  An ethic of service to one’s group is a form of Communal Sharing.  It is an altruistic ethic in some sense, but bear in mind that all members of the group share a common identity.  So, strictly speaking, it is not true altruism.  Authority Ranking informs an ethic of obedience to authority including respect, honor, and loyalty.  Any questions of value remaining to be clarified are settled by the authority; subordinates are expected to follow the values thus dictated.  Fairness and even distribution are informed by Equality Matching.  John Rawls’ veil of ignorance exemplifies Equality Matching; a perspective in which one does not know which role one will play guarantees that one aim for equality.  Gregory Vlastos has even attempted to reduce all distributive justice to a framework that can be identified with Equality Matching.  Market Pricing informs libertarian values of freely entering into contracts and taking risks with the aim of increasing one’s own utility or the utility of one’s group.  But this also includes suffering the losses when one’s calculations prove incorrect.  Utilitarianism is a somewhat counterintuitive attempt to extend this sort of morality to all sentient life, but is still recognizable as Market Pricing.  It would be too simple, however, to say that there are only four sorts of values in RMT.  In fact, combinations of models yield complex models, resulting in a potential infinity of complex values.  Potential variety is further increased by the variability of possible preos.  This great variety of values leads to value conflicts most noticeably across cultures.

RMT strongly suggests value pluralism, in Isaiah Berlin’s sense of “pluralism”.  The pluralism in question is a cultural pluralism, different traditions producing mutually incommensurable values.  Berlin drew a distinction between relativism and pluralism, even though there are strong similarities between the two.  Relativism and pluralism both acknowledge values which are incommensurable, meaning that they cannot be reconciled and that there is no absolute or objective way to judge between them.  Pluralism, however, acknowledges empathy and emotional understanding across cultures.  Even if one does not accept the values of another culture, one still has an emotional understanding of how such values could be adopted.  This stands in contrast to relativism, as defined by Berlin.  If relativism is true, then there can be no emotional understanding of alien values.  One understands the value system of an alien culture in essentially the same manner as one understands the behavior of ants or, for that matter, the behavior of tectonic plates; it is a purely causal understanding.  It is the emotionally remote understanding of the scientist rather than the empathic understanding of someone engaging, say, with the poetry and theatre of another culture.  Adopting RMT, pluralism seems quite plausible.  Given that one has the mental capacity to generate the relevant model, one can replicate the alien value in oneself.  One is not simply thinking about the foreigner’s relational model, but using one’s shared human nature to produce that same model in oneself.  This does not, however, mean that one adopts that value, since one can also retain the conflicting model characteristic of one’s own culture.  One’s decisive motivation may still flow wholly from the latter.

But the significance of RMT for the debate over pluralism and absolutism may be more complex than indicated above.  Since RMT incorporates the view that people perceive social relationships as intrinsic values, this may indicate that a society which fosters interactions and relationships is absolutely better than one which divides and atomizes, at least along that one dimension.  This may be an element of moral absolutism in RMT, and it is interesting to see how it is to be reconciled with any pluralism also implied.

b. Computational Conceptions of Cognition

The examples of embedding in Section 1.d. not only illustrate the productivity of social-relational cognition, but also its systematicity.  To speak of the systematicity of thought means that the ability to think a given thought renders probable the ability to think a semantically close thought.  The ability to conceive of Authority Ranking embedding Market Pricing makes it highly likely that one can conceive of Market Pricing embedding Authority Ranking.  One finds productivity and systematicity in language as well.  Any phrase can be embedded in a superordinate phrase.  For example, the determiner phrase [the water] is embedded in the prepositional phrase [in [the water]], and the prepositional phrase [in [the water]] is embedded in the determiner phrase [the fish [in [the water]]].  The in-principle absence of limit here means that the number of phrases is infinite.  Further, the ability to parse (or understand) a phrase renders very probable the ability to parse (or understand) a semantically close phrase.  For example, being able to mentally process Plato did trust Socrates makes it likely that one can process Socrates did trust Plato as well as Plato did trust Plato and Socrates did trust Socrates.  Productivity and systematicity, either in language or in social-relational cognition, constitute a strong inductive argument for a combinatorial operation that respects semantic relations.  (The operation respects semantic relations, given that the meaning of a generated compound is a function of the meanings of its constituents and their arrangement.)  In other words, it is an argument for digital computation.

This is essentially Noam Chomsky’s argument for a computational procedure explaining syntax (insofar as syntax is not idiomatic).  It is also essentially Jerry Fodor’s argument for computational procedures constituting thought processes more generally.  That digital computation underlies both complex social-relational cognition and language raises important questions.  Are all mental processes largely computational or might language and social-relational cognition be special cases?  Do language and social-relational cognition share the same computational mechanism or do they each have their own?  What are the constraints on computation in either language or social-relational cognition?

c. Platonism

Chomsky has noted the discrete infinity of language.  Each phrase consists of a number of constituents which can be counted using natural numbers (discreteness), and there is no longest phrase meaning that the set of all possible phrases is infinite.  Analogous points apply to social-relational cognition.  The number of instances of an elementary mod within any mod can be counted using natural numbers.  In the case discussed earlier in which a customer is ordering food from a waiter, there is one instance of Authority Ranking embedded in one instance of Market Pricing.  The total number of instances is two, a natural number.  There is no principled upper limit on the number of embeddings, hence infinity.  The discrete infinity of language and social-relational cognition is tantamount to their productivity.

However, some philosophers, especially Jerrold Katz, have argued that nothing empirical can exhibit discrete infinity.  Something empirical may be continuously infinite, such as a volume of space containing infinitely many points.  But the indefinite addition of constituent upon constituent has no empirical exemplification.  Space-time, if it were finite in this sense, would contain only finite energy and a finite number of particles.  There are not infinitely many objects, as discrete infinity would imply.  On this reasoning, the discrete infinity of an entity can only mean that the entity exists beyond space and time, still assuming that space-time is finite.  This would mean that sentences, and by similar reasoning compound mods as well, are abstract objects rather than neural features or processes.  This would mean that mods and sentences are abstract objects like numbers.  One finds here a kind of Platonism, Platonism here defined as the view that there are abstract objects.

As a tentative reply, one could say that the symbols generated by a computational system are potentially infinite in number, but this raises questions about the nature of potentiality.  What is a merely potential mod or a merely potential sentence?  It is not something with any spatiotemporal location or any causal power.  Perhaps it is sentence types (as contrasted with tokens) that exhibit discrete infinity.  And likewise with mods, it is mod types that exhibit discrete infinity.  But here too, one is appealing to entities, namely types, that have no spatiotemporal location or causal power.  By definition, these are abstract objects.

The case for Platonism is perhaps stronger for compound mods, but one could also defend the same conclusion with regard to the elementary mods.  Each elementary mod, as noted earlier, corresponds to one of the classic measurement scales.  Different scale types are presupposed by different logics.  Classical two-valued logic presupposes a nominal scale, as illustrated by the law of excluded middle: a statement is either on the truth scale, in which case it is true, or off the scale, in which case it is false.  Alternatively, one could posit two categories, one for true and one for false, and stipulate that any statement belongs on one scale or the other.  Fuzzy logics conceive truth either in terms of interval scales, for example, it is two degrees more true that Michel is bald than that Van is bald, or in terms of ratio scales, for example, it is 80 percent true that Van is bald, 100 percent true that Michel is bald.  Even though it has perhaps not been formalized, there is intuitively a logic which presupposes an ordinal scale.  A logic, say,  in which it is more true that chess is a game than that Ring a Ring o’ Roses is a game, even though it would be meaningless to ask how much more.  If nominal, ordinal, interval, and ratio scales are more basic than various logics, then the question arises as to whether they can seriously be considered empirical or spatiotemporal.  If anything is Platonic, then something more basic than logic is likely to be Platonic.  And what is an elementary mod aside from the scale type which it “resembles”?  Is there any reason to distinguish the elementary mod from the scale type itself?  If not, then the elementary mods themselves are abstract objects, at least on this argument.

Does reflection upon language and the relational models support a Platonist metaphysic?  If so, what is one to make of the earlier discussion of RMT appealing, as it did, to neural symmetry breakings and mental computations?  If mods are abstract objects, then the symmetry breakings and computations may belong to the epistemology of RMT rather than to its metaphysics.  In other words, they may throw light on how one knows about mods rather than actually constituting the mods themselves.  Specifically, the symmetry breaking and computations may account for the production of mental representations of mods rather than the mods themselves.  But whether or not there is a good case here for Platonism is, no doubt, open to further questioning.

3. References

a. Specifically Addressing Relational Models Theory

  • Bolender, John. (2010), The Self-Organizing Social Mind (Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press).
    • Argues that the elementary relational models are due to self-organizing brain activity.  Also contains a discussion of possible Platonist implications of RMT.
  • Bolender, John. (2011), Digital Social Mind (Exeter, UK: Imprint Academic).
    • Argues that complex relational models are due to mental computations.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1990), “Relativity within Moose (‘Mossi’) culture: four incommensurable models for social relationships,” Ethos, 18, pp. 180-204.
    • Fiske here argues that RMT supports moral relativism, although his “relativism” may be the same as Berlin’s “pluralism.”
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1991), Structures of Social Life: The Four Elementary Forms of Human Relations (New York: The Free Press).
    • The classic work on RMT, containing the first full statement of the theory and a wealth of anthropological illustrations.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (1992), “The Four Elementary Forms of Sociality: Framework for a Unified Theory of Social Relations,” Psychological Review, 99, 689-723.
    • Essentially, a shorter version of Fiske’s (1991).  Nonetheless, this is a detailed and substantial introduction to RMT.
  • Fiske, Alan Page. (2004), “Relational Models Theory 2.0,” in Haslam (2004a).
    • An updated introduction to RMT.
  • Haslam, Nick. ed. (2004a), Relational Models Theory: A Contemporary Overview (Mahwah, New Jersey and London: Lawrence Erlbaum).
    • An anthology containing an updated introduction to RMT as well as discussions of controlled empirical evidence supporting the theory.
  • Haslam, Nick. ed. (2004b), “Research on the Relational Models: An Overview,” in Haslam (2004a).
    • Reviews controlled studies corroborating that the elementary relational models play an important role in cognition including person perception.
  • Pinker, Steven. (2007), The Stuff of Thought: Language as a Window into Human Nature (London: Allen Lane).
    • Argues that Market Pricing, in contrast to the other three elementary models, is not innate and is somehow unnatural.

b. Related Issues

  • Berlin, Isaiah. (1990), The Crooked Timber of Humanity: Chapters in the History of Ideas. Edited by H. Hardy (London: Pimlico).
    • A discussion of value pluralism in the context of history of ideas.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. (1987), Psychosemantics: The Problem of Meaning in the Philosophy of Mind (Cambridge, Mass. and London: MIT Press).
    • The Appendix argues that systematicity and productivity in thought require a combinatorial system.  The point, however, is a general one, not specifically focused on social-relational cognition.
  • Katz, Jerrold J. (1996), “The unfinished Chomskyan revolution,” Mind & Language, 11 (3), pp. 270-294.
    • Argues that only an abstract object can exhibit discrete infinity.
  • Rawls, John. (1971), A Theory of Justice (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press).
    • The veil of ignorance illustrates Equality Matching.
  • Szpiro, George G. (2010), Numbers Rule: The Vexing Mathematics of Democracy, from Plato to the Present (Princeton: Princeton University Press).
    • Illustrates various ways in which Equality Matching can be implemented.
  • Stevens, S. S. (1946), “On the Theory of Scales of Measurement,” Science 103, pp. 677-680.
    • A classic discussion of the types of measurement scales.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. (1962), “Justice and Equality,” in Richard B. Brandt, ed. Social Justice (Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice-Hall).
    • An attempt to understand all distributive justice in terms of Equality Matching.

Author Information

John Bolender
Middle East Technical University

Skeptical Theism

Skeptical theism is the view that God exists but that we should be skeptical of our ability to discern God’s reasons for acting or refraining from acting in any particular instance.  In particular, says the skeptical theist, we should not grant that our inability to think of a good reason for doing or allowing something is indicative of whether or not God might have a good reason for doing or allowing something.  If there is a God, he knows much more than we do about the relevant facts, and thus it would not be surprising at all if he has reasons for doing or allowing something that we cannot fathom.

If skeptical theism is true, it appears to undercut the primary argument for atheism, namely the argument from evil.  This is because skeptical theism provides a reason to be skeptical of a crucial premise in the argument from evil, namely the premise that asserts that at least some of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  If we are not in a position to tell whether God has a reason for allowing any particular instance of evil, then we are not in a position to judge whether any of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  And if we cannot tell whether any of the evils in our world are gratuitous, then we cannot appeal to the existence of gratuitous evil to conclude that God does not exist.  The remainder of this article explains skeptical theism more fully, applies it to the argument from evil, and surveys the reasons for and against being a skeptical theist.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction to Skeptical Theism
  2. The Argument from Evil
  3. Responses to the Argument from Evil
    1. Denying the Minor Premise
    2. Skepticism about the Minor Premise
  4. Defenses of Skeptical Theism
    1. Arguments from Analogy
    2. Arguments from Complexity
    3. Arguments from Enabling Premises
  5. Objections to Skeptical Theism
    1. Implications for the Divine-Human Relationship
    2. Implications for Everyday Knowledge
    3. Implications for Commonsense Epistemology
    4. Implications for Moral Theory
    5. Implications for Moral Living
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction to Skeptical Theism

Skeptical theism is a conjunction of two theses.  The first thesis of skeptical theism is that theism is true, where “theism” is roughly the view that God exists and “God,” in turn, is an honorific title describing the most perfect being possible.  This is the being putatively described in classical western theologies of Judaism, Christianity, Islam, and some theistic forms of Eastern religions.  The second thesis is that a certain limited form of skepticism is true, where this skepticism applies to the ability of humans to make all-things-considered judgments about what God would do or allow in any particular situation.  Not all theists are skeptical theists, and not all of the philosophers who endorse the skeptical component of skeptical theism are theists.  Since it is the skeptical component that is of most interest, it will be the focus in what follows.

It is important to get clear on the scope of the skepticism endorsed by skeptical theists.  First, it is not a global skepticism—skeptical theists are not committed to the view that we cannot know anything at all.  Instead, the skepticism is (putatively) limited to a narrow range of propositions, namely those having to do with God’s reasons for action.  For example, a skeptical theist could admit that humans have ceteris paribus knowledge of God’s reasons for actions.  An example of such knowledge might be the following: other-things-being-equal, God will eliminate suffering when he is able to do so.  However, knowing this latter claim is consistent with denying that we know the following: God will eliminate this particular instance of suffering.  Holding the combination of these two views is possible for the following reason: while we might know that other-things-being-equal, God will eliminate suffering when he is able to do so, we might not know whether or not other things are equal in any particular instance of suffering.

As an example of this limited sort of skepticism, consider a much more mundane example.  One might know that other-things-being-equal, it is better to save aces in a hand of draw poker (since aces are the highest denomination).  However, one might know this while at the same time withholding judgment on whether or not it is a good idea for Jones to save aces in any particular hand, since one would not know what Jones’ other cards were (for example, perhaps saving an ace requires discarding a member of a four-of-a-kind set in another denomination).

2. The Argument from Evil

Agnosticism is the philosophical view that neither affirms that God exists nor affirms that God does not exist.  On the other hand, atheism is the view that God does not exist.  Perhaps the most powerful argument for atheism is the argument from evil.  According to this line of reasoning, the fact that the world contains evil is powerful evidence that God does not exist.  This is because God is supposed to be the most perfect being possible, and among these perfections is both perfect power and perfect goodness.  If God were perfectly powerful, then he would be able to eliminate all instances of evil.  If God were perfectly good, then he would want to eliminate all instances of evil.  Thus, if God exists, there would be no evil.  But there is evil.  Therefore, God does not exist.

While the foregoing sketches the rough terrain, the argument from evil comes in two distinct forms.  First is the logical problem of evil.  According to the logical problem of evil, it is not logically possible for both evil and God to coexist.  Any world in which God exists will be a world devoid of any evil.  Thus, anyone who believes both that God exists and that evil exists is committed to an implicit contradiction.

Second is the evidential argument from evil. According to the evidential argument from evil, while it is logically possible that both God and evil coexist, the latter is evidence against the former.  The evidential argument is sometimes put in terms of an inference to the best explanation (that is, the abductive argument from evil) and sometimes in terms of probabilities (that is, the inductive argument from evil).  In either case, certain facts about the existence, nature and distribution of evils in the world are offered as pro tanto evidence against the truth of theism.  This article focuses on the probabilistic (inductive) version of the evidential argument from evil as it is the most common in the contemporary literature.

It is widely conceded that there is no logical problem of evil for the following reason: if there is a God, he would allow any particular instance of evil that is necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good.  For instance, the experience of pain is an intrinsic evil.  However, the fact that a human father allows his child to experience the pain of an inoculation does not thereby show that the father is not perfectly good.  That is because, although evil in itself, the pain was necessary to secure a compensating good, namely being immune to a painful or deadly disease.  Philosophers call any instance of evil that is not necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good a gratuitous evil.  Thus, it is only the existence of gratuitous evil (instead of any evil whatsoever) that poses a (putative) problem for theism.

With the distinction between gratuitous and non-gratuitous evil in hand, the evidential argument from evil can be formulated as follows:

1. If God exists, then there are no instances of gratuitous evil.

2. It is likely that at least some instances of evil are gratuitous.

3. Therefore, it is likely that God does not exist.

The gist is that insofar as we have reason to believe that at least some of the evils in our world are not necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good, we have reason to believe that God does not exist.  So there is still a sense in which a logical problem of evil remains—it is logically impossible that God and gratuitous evil coexist.  The evidential nature of this argument focuses around premise (2): the best we can do is to present an inductive case for the claim that any particular evil in our world is gratuitous.

3. Responses to the Argument from Evil

Theists have challenged both premises in the argument from evil.  Regarding premise (1), some have challenged the notion that God is required by his moral perfection to eliminate all instances of gratuitous evil (for example, Van Inwagen 2003).  However, by and large, theists have focused their attention on the minor premise: the claim that it is likely that some of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  There are two ways of responding to this premise.  One may either deny it or seek to show that we should be agnostic about it.  Each strategy is sketched below.

a. Denying the Minor Premise

Challenges to the argument from evil that purport to show that premise (2) is false are typically called theodicies.  A theodicy is an attempt to show that no actual evil in our world is gratuitous, or, in logically equivalent terms, that all the evils in our world are necessary either to avoid some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating (or justifying) good.  If a theist can successfully show this, then premise (2) in the argument from evil is false, and the argument from evil is unsound.

Theodicies take a number of different forms.  Some try to show that the evils in our world are necessary for compensating goods such as moral development, significant free will, and so on.  Others try to show that evils in our world are necessary to avoid evils equally bad or worse.  In either case, a successful theodicy will have to be thorough—if even one instance of evil in the world turns out to be gratuitous, the minor premise is true and the argument from evil goes through.

b. Skepticism about the Minor Premise

The burden of proof for a theodicy is tremendously high.  The theodicist must show that all of the evils in our world are non-gratuitous.  For this reason, many theistic philosophers prefer only to show that we should be agnostic about premise (2).  Skepticism about premise (2) is typically defended in one of two ways: by appeal to a defense or by appeal to the resources of skeptical theism.

Unlike a theodicy, a defense does not attempt to show what God’s actual reason is for allowing any particular instance of evil.  Instead, it attempts to show what God’s reasons might be for all we know.  And if God might have reasons for allowing a particular evil that we do not know about, then we are in no position to endorse premise (2) in the evidential argument from evil.  The idea is that there are relevant alternatives that we are in no position to rule out, and unless we are in such a position, we should not conclude that the minor premise is true.

For example, suppose you are a jurist in a criminal case, and—given only the videotape evidence—you cannot determine whether the defendant or his twin committed the crime.  In this case, you are not justified in concluding that the defendant is guilty, and that is because there is a live possibility that you cannot rule out, and this possibility would show that the defendant is innocent.  The same might be said of premise (2) in the argument from evil: there are live possibilities that we are in no position to rule out, and these possibilities show that God is justified in allowing the evils in our world.  And if so, we are in no position to endorse premise (2) of the argument from evil.

Skeptical theism provides a second, independent case for agnosticism about premise (2).  This case takes the form of an undercutting defeater for the standard defense of premise (2).  Why should we think that it is likely that at least some of the evils in our world are gratuitous?  The standard defense of this claim is as follows:

Well, it seems like many of the evils in our world are gratuitous, so it is likely that at least some instances of evil are gratuitous.

Put differently, we cannot see any reason for God to allow some of the evils in our world, therefore there we should conclude that there is no reason for God to allow some of the evils in our world.  Call this inference pattern the “noseeum” inference (“if we can’t see ‘um, they ain’t there”).

The skeptical theist denies the strength of this noseeum inference.  The fact that an evil appears to be gratuitous to us is not indicative of whether or not it is gratuitous.  So on the one hand, the skeptical theist is happy to grant that it seems as if many of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  However, she denies that this fact is good evidence for the claim that such evils really are gratuitous.  And hence we have no reason to endorse premise (2) in the argument from evil.

4. Defenses of Skeptical Theism

As a reply to the argument from evil, skeptical theism seems initially quite plausible.  Surely if there were a God, there would be many, many cases in which we could see no reason for a course of action although such reasons were available to God. Some things that look unjustifiable given our own perspectives are justifiable once one has all the facts.  Besides relying on this initial plausibility, skeptical theists have defended their view in roughly three ways.

a. Arguments from Analogy

The fact that a young child cannot discern a reason for her parents allowing her to suffer pain does not constitute a good reason for the young child to conclude that there are no such reasons.  In this case, a clear example of the noseeum inference fails.  Given the child’s limited knowledge and experience as compared to the knowledge and experience of her parents, she ought not conclude that her parents are not justified in allowing a certain evil to occur.  Other similar examples are easy to come by: if one does not play much chess, the fact that one cannot see why the chess master makes a particular move is not indicative of whether or not such a move is justified.  It would be silly to reason as follows: I cannot see a good reason for that move, therefore, there is no good reason for that move.

If these cases are persuasive, the skeptical theist can defend her position accordingly.  The cognitive distance between a young child and her parents is analogous to the cognitive position between a human agent and God.  Thus, the fact that a human is unable to see a reason for allowing a particular evil is not a good reason for concluding that God would have no reason for allowing that evil.

b. Arguments from Complexity

On its face, premise (2) is very straightforward: it is very likely that at least some of the evils in our world are gratuitous.  But when we get clear on what that means, we see that this kind of judgment is extraordinarily complex.  It says, in effect, that we are able to identify some instances of evil which were not necessary either to avoid an evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating good.  How could we ever know such complex facts?  For example, consider the following:

On the night that Sir Winston Churchill was conceived, had Lady Randolph Churchill fallen asleep in a slightly different position, the precise pathway that each of the millions of spermatozoa took would have been slightly altered.  As a result…Sir Winston Churchill, as we knew him, would not have existed, with the likely result that the evolution of World War II would have been substantially different… (Durston 2000, p. 66)

On the face of it, it appears that it would not matter what position Lady Churchill sleeps in.  Put differently, it appears that there is no good reason to prefer her sleeping in one position rather than another.  But given the specifics of human reproduction, this assumption is unwarranted and—in this case—plausibly false.  So the fact that we cannot see a reason is not indicative of whether or not there is any such reason.  This same objection applies, mutatis mutandis, to the inference from “we can see no reason to allow this evil” to “there is no reason to allow this evil.”

c. Arguments from Enabling Premises

One of the most sophisticated defenses of skeptical theism insists that some sort of enabling premise must be reasonably believed before noseeum inferences are warranted and, further, that this enabling premise is not reasonably believed with regard to inferences about what God would allow.  Two such enabling premises have been proposed in the literature: the first concerns our sensitivity to evidence and the second concerns the representativeness of our inductive samples.

The most common instance of the sensitivity strategy invokes an epistemic principle dubbed the Condition on Reasonable Epistemic Access, or “CORNEA” for short (Wyskstra 1984).  CORNEA says that inferences from “I see no X” to “There is no X” are justified only if it is reasonable to believe that if there were an X, I would likely see it.  So, for example, the inference from “I see no elephant in my office” to “There is no elephant in my office” is licensed by CORNEA since I reasonably believe that if there were an elephant in my office, I would likely see it.  However, such skeptical theists have insisted that it is not reasonable for me to think that if there were a reason for allowing any particular evil that I would be aware of it.  Given this assumption, CORNEA says that the inference from “I see no reason for allowing this instance of evil” to “There is no reason for allowing this instance of evil” is invalid.

The second strategy has to do with our knowledge of the representativeness of the inductive sample used in the noseeum inference.  According to this version of the strategy, the inductive move from “I see no X” to “There is no X” is warranted only if it is reasonable for me to believe that my inductive sample of X’s is representative of the whole.  For example, one should not rely on inductive evidence to conclude that all crows are black unless it is reasonable to assume that one’s sample of crows is representative of all crows.  As applied to the argument from evil, the inference from “I can see no reason to allow this evil” to “There is no reason to allow this evil” is justified only if it is reasonable for one to believe that the sample of reasons currently understood is representative of all of the reasons that are.  The crucial question then becomes whether or not any of us have good reason to think that our sample of goods, evils, and the connections between them is suitably representative.  Some philosophers think that we do have such reason (for example, Tooley 1991).  Others think that our knowledge is not representative (for example, Sennett 1993).  Others think we cannot tell one way or the other whether our sample is representative, and thus we lack good reason for thinking that the sample is representative, as required by the second strategy (for example, Bergmann 2001).

5. Objections to Skeptical Theism

As with any form of skepticism, skeptical theism has its critics.  Some of these critics are theists who think that skeptical theism has unbecoming implications for issues of importance to theism (such as knowledge of God, relationship with God, and the like).  Other critics think that skeptical theism has unbecoming implications for more general issues such as everyday knowledge, moral living, and so on.  The objections to skeptical theism fall roughly into five different sorts.

a. Implications for the Divine-Human Relationship

One prominent criticism of skeptical theism is that it eliminates the potential for a close relationship between humans and God.  It does so in two ways.  First, if skeptical theism undercuts arguments against the existence of God by highlighting the fact that we know very little about how God would act (all-things-considered), then by parity of reasoning it also undercuts arguments for the existence of God.  Skeptical theist considerations seem to suggest agnosticism about whether God would create a world, finely-tune the universe, create rational beings, and so on, despite the fact that each of these are assumptions in standard arguments for the existence of God.  And the same considerations appear to undercut our knowledge of God’s interactions in the world; it is no longer open to the theist to say what God wants in her life (all-things-considered), whether a particular event was a miracle, and so on.

Second, skeptical theism not only appears to undercut one’s knowledge of God, but it also seems to undercut one’s trust in God.  Being in a close relationship with another person requires some kind of understanding of what the other person wants and why the other person acts as she does.  Furthermore, communication is important to a relationship, but skeptical theists should not trust communication from God (including divine commands, mystical experiences, and so on).  Why?  Because for all we know, God has a reason for deceiving us that is beyond our ken.

b. Implications for Everyday Knowledge

Any non-global version of skepticism will face objections that attempt to stretch the skepticism to new areas of inquiry.  One objection of this sort claims that skeptical theism breaks down into a near-global skepticism that disallows what we might think of as everyday knowledge.  Consider the claim that all crows are black.  This seems a perfect example of everyday knowledge.  But a skeptical crowist might respond as follows: “for all we know, there are purple crows beyond our ken, thus, the fact that we see no purple crows is not indicative of the fact that there are no purple crows.”  Thus we do not know the claim that all crows are black.

c. Implications for Commonsense Epistemology

Others have argued not that skeptical theism is incompatible with any particular knowledge claim but that it is incompatible with a promising set of theories in epistemology.  In particular, skeptical theism appears to rule out so-called commonsense epistemologies that rely on something like the principle of credulity: other things being equal, it is reasonable to believe that things are as they appear.  The problem is that skeptical theists grant that at least some evils appear gratuitous, thus, by the principle of credulity, they ought to grant that it is reasonable to believe that at least some evils are gratuitous.  But that is precisely what skeptical theism denies.

d. Implications for Moral Theory

The skeptical theist’s strategy relies on the presumption that there are some moral judgments that we are not justified in making.  Consider an instance of childhood cancer.  The skeptical theist is unwilling to grant that this evil is gratuitous because—for all we know—it was necessary either to prevent some evil equally bad or worse or to secure some compensating good.  Furthermore, if the evil is not gratuitous, it seems that it would be morally permissible (or even morally obligatory) for God to allow that evil to occur.  This is how the skeptical theist hopes to get God off the hook: we cannot blame him for creating the actual world if he meets all of his moral obligations in doing so.

The putative problem is that the skeptical theist seems to be committed to a consequentialist view of ethics, and many philosophers find such a view unappealing.  The apparent implications result from the fact that a skeptical theist seems to allow that no matter how horrendous a particular instance of evil might be, it can always be justified given good enough consequences.  Thus, if one thinks that there are some things that morally ought not be allowed regardless of consequences (such as the torture of an innocent person), this putative implication counts against skeptical theism.

e. Implications for Moral Living

Finally, the most pressing objection to skeptical theism is that it seems to preclude both the possibility of engaging in moral deliberation and the possibility of moral knowledge.  The putative problem can be sketched as follows: if, for any instance of evil, we are unable to tell whether or not the evil is gratuitous, then we are unable to engage in moral deliberation and arrive at a view about what is reasonable for us to do.  For example, suppose a skeptical theist comes upon a young boy drowning in a pond.  His skeptical theism seems to commit him to reasoning as follows: for all I know, the boy’s death is necessary to prevent some greater evil or to secure some greater good, thus I do not have a reason to intervene.

Skeptical theists have offered a number of interesting responses to this objection.  Some think that what is wrong for a person depends only on what he or she knows, and thus it would be wrong for the bystander to let the boy drown since he does not know that the boy’s death is non-gratuitous.  Others think that what is right for God to allow might be different than what is right for us to allow.  In that case, it might be wrong for you to let the boy drown even though you cannot conclude (for skeptical theist reasons) that it is wrong for God to do the same.  Still others insist that there is no unique difficulty here: everyone faces the hurdle of attempting to decide whether a particular event will have, on balance, good or bad consequences.  In that case, though it is true that moral deliberation is difficult given skeptical theism, it is also difficult given any view of religious epistemology.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Almeida, M. & Oppy, G. (2003) “Sceptical Theism and Evidential Arguments from Evil,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 81:4, pp. 496-516.
    • An objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for the moral life.
  • Alston, W. (1991) “The Inductive Argument from Evil and the Human Cognitive Condition,” Philosophical Perspectives 5, pp. 29-67.
    • A defense of skeptical theism by appeal to analogy.
  • Bergmann, M. (2001) “Skeptical Theism and Rowe’s New Evidential Argument from Evil,” Nous 35, pp. 278-296.
    • Seminal statement of skeptical theism and a defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises.
  • Draper, P. (1989) “Pain and Pleasure: An Evidential Problem for Theists,” Nous 23, pp. 331-350.
    • A concise statement of the abductive argument from evil.
  • Dougherty, T. (2008) “Epistemological Considerations Concerning Skeptical Theism,” Faith & Philosophy 25, pp. 172-176.
    • An objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for commonsense epistemology.
  • Durston, K. (2000) “The consequential complexity of history and gratuitous evil,” Religious Studies 36, pp. 65-80.
    • A defense of skeptical theism by appeal to complexity.
  • Hasker, W. (2004) “The sceptical solution to the problem of evil,” in Hasker, W. Providence, Evil, and the Openness of God (Routledge) pp. 43-57.
    • An example of an objection to skeptical theism by a theist
  • Hick, J. (1966) Evil and the God of Love (Harper & Rowe).
    • A clear presentation and defense of a soul-crafting theodicy.
  • Howard-Snyder, D. (2010) “Epistemic Humility, Arguments from Evil, and Moral Skepticism,”in Kvanvig, J. (ed.) Oxford Studies in Philosophy of Religion (Oxford: Oxford University Press) pp. 17-57.
    • Responding to an objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for moral living.
  • Jordan, J. (2006) “Does Skeptical Theism Lead to Moral Skepticism?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 72, pp. 403-416.
    • An objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for moral living.
  • Mackie, J.L. (1955) “Evil and Omnipotence,” Mind 64:254, pp. 200-212.
    • The classic statement of the logical problem of evil.
  • McBrayer, J. (2010) “Skeptical Theism,” Philosophy Compass 4:1, pp. 1-13 (Blackwell).
    • A thorough review of the case for and against skeptical theism with an exhaustive bibliography.
  • McBrayer, J. (2009) “CORNEA and Inductive Evidence,” Faith & Philosophy 26:1, pp. 77-86.
    • An objection to the defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises
  • Plantinga, A. (1974) God, Freedom, and Evil (Eerdmans).
    • The classic response to the logical problem of evil.
  • Rowe, W. (2001) “Skeptical Theism: A Response to Bergmann,” Nous 35, pp. 297-303.
    • An objection to the defense of skeptical theism by appeal to analogies and enabling premises.
  • Rowe, W. (1979) “The Problem of Evil and Some Varieties of Atheism,” American Philosophical Quarterly 16, pp. 335-41.
    • A clear and classic statement of the evidential argument from evil.
  • Sennett, J. (1993) “The Inscrutable Evil Defense against the Inductive Argument from Evil,” Faith & Philosophy 10, pp. 220-229.
    • A defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises.
  • Tooley, M. (1991) “The Argument from Evil,” Philosophical Perspectives 5, pp. 89-134.
    • An objection to the defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises.
  • Trakakis, N. (2003) “Evil and the complexity of history: a response to Durston,” Religious     Studies 39, pp. 451-458.
    • An objection to the defense of skeptical theism by appeal to complexity.
  • Van Inwagen, P. (2003) The Problem of Evil (Oxford University Press).
    • A clear presentation of the argument from evil (§2) and an example of a defense.
  • Wilks, I. (2009) “Skeptical Theism and Empirical Unfalsifiability,” Faith & Philosophy 26:1, pp. 64-76.
    • An objection to skeptical theism based on its implications for everyday knowledge.
  • Wykstra, S. (1984) “The Humean Obstacle to Evidential Arguments from Suffering: On Avoiding the Evils of ‘Appearance’,” International Journal of Philosophy of Religion 16, pp. 73-93.
    • A defense of skeptical theism by appeal to enabling premises.

Author Information

Justin P. McBrayer
Fort Lewis College
U. S. A.

Jerry A. Fodor (1935— )

J. FodorJerry Fodor is one of the principal philosophers of mind of the late twentieth and early twenty-first century. In addition to having exerted an enormous influence on virtually every portion of the philosophy of mind literature since 1960, Fodor’s work has had a significant impact on the development of the cognitive sciences. In the 1960s, along with Hilary Putnam, Noam Chomsky, and others, he put forward influential criticisms of the behaviorism that dominated much philosophy and psychology at the time. Since then, Fodor has articulated and defended an alternative, realist conception of intentional states and their content that he argues vindicates the core elements of folk psychology within a physicalist framework.

Fodor has developed two theories that have been particularly influential across disciplinary boundaries. He defends a “Representational Theory of Mind,” according to which mental states are computational relations that organisms bear to mental representations that are physically realized in the brain. On Fodor’s view, these mental representations are internally structured much like sentences in a natural language, in that they have both syntactic structure and a compositional semantics. Fodor also defends an influential hypothesis about mental architecture, namely, that low-level sensory systems (and language) are “modular,” in the sense that they’re “informationally encapsulated” from the higher-level “central” systems responsible for belief formation, decision-making, and the like. Fodor’s work on modularity has been especially influential among evolutionary psychologists, who go much further than Fodor in claiming that the systems underlying even high-level cognition are modular, a view that Fodor himself vehemently resists.

Fodor has also defended a number of other influential views. He was an early proponent of the claim that mental properties are functional properties, defined by their role in a cognitive system and not by the physical material that constitutes them. Alongside functionalism, Fodor defended an early and influential version of non-reductive physicalism, according to which mental properties are realized by, but not reducible to, physical properties of the brain. Fodor has also long been a staunch defender of nativism about the structure and contents of the human mind, arguing against a variety of empiricist theories and famously arguing that all lexical concepts are innate. When it comes to a theory of concepts, Fodor has vigorously argued against all versions of inferential role semantics in philosophy and psychology. Fodor’s own view is what he calls “informational atomism,” according to which lexical concepts are internally unstructured and have their content in virtue of standing in certain external, “informational” relations to properties instantiated in the environment.

Table of Contents

  1. Biography
  2. Physicalism, Functionalism, and the Special Sciences
  3. Intentional Realism
  4. The Representational Theory of Mind
  5. Content and Concepts
  6. Nativism
  7. Modularity
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Biography

Jerry Fodor was born in New York City in 1935. He received his A.B. from Columbia University in 1956 and his Ph.D. from Princeton University in 1960. His first academic position was at MIT, where he taught in the Departments of Philosophy and Psychology until 1986. He was Distinguished Professor at CUNY Graduate Center from 1986 to 1988, when he moved to Rutgers University where he has remained ever since. He is currently the State of New Jersey Professor of Philosophy and Cognitive Science.

2. Physicalism, Functionalism, and the Special Sciences

Throughout his career Fodor has subscribed to physicalism, the claim that all the genuine particulars and properties in the world are either identical to or in some sense determined by and dependent upon physical particulars and properties. Although there are many questions about how physicalism should be formulated and understood—for instance, what “physical” means and whether the relevant determination/dependency relation is “supervenience” (Kim 1993) or “realization” (Melnyk 2003, Shoemkaer 2007)—there’s widespread acceptance of some or other version of physicalism among philosophers of mind. To accept physicalism is to deny that psychological and other non-basic properties “float free” from the fundamental physical properties. Thus, acceptance of physicalism  goes hand in hand with a rejection of mind-body dualism.

Some of Fodor’s early work (1968, 1975) aimed (i) to show that “mentalism” was a genuine alternative to dualism and behaviorism, (ii) to show that behaviorism had a number of serious shortcomings, (iii) to defend functionalism as the appropriate physicalist metaphysics underlying mentalism, and (iv) to defend a conception of psychology and other special sciences according to which higher-level laws and the properties that figure in them are irreducible to lower-level laws and properties. Let’s consider each of these in turn.


For much of the twentieth century, behaviorism was widely regarded as the only viable physicalist alternative to dualism. Fodor helped to change that, in part by drawing a clear distinction between mere mentalism, which posits the existence of internal, causally efficacious mental states, and dualism, which is mentalism plus the view that mental events require a special kind of substance. Here’s Fodor in his classic book Psychological Explanation:

[P]hilosophers who have wanted to banish the ghost from the machine have usually sought to do so by showing that truths about behavior can sometimes, and in some sense, logically implicate truths about mental states. In so doing, they have rather strongly suggested that the exorcism can be carried through only if such a logical connection can be made out. … [O]nce it has been made clear that the choice between dualism and behaviorism is not exhaustive, a major motivation for the defense of behaviorism is removed: we are not required to be behaviorists simply in order to avoid being dualists” (1968, pp. 58-59).

Fodor thus argues that there’s a middle road between dualism and behaviorism. Attributing mental states to organisms in explaining how they get around in and manipulate their environments need not involve the postulation of a mental substance different in kind from physical bodies and brains. In Fodor’s view, behaviorists influenced by Wittgenstein and Ryle ignored the distinction between mentalism and dualism—as he puts it, “confusing mentalism with dualism is the original sin of the Wittgensteinian tradition” (Fodor, 1975, p. 4).

In addition to clearly distinguishing mentalism from dualism, Fodor put forward a number of trenchant objections to behaviorism and the various arguments for it. He argued, for instance, that neither knowing about the mental states of others nor learning a language with mental terms requires that there be a logical connection, that is, a deductively valid connection, between mental and behavioral terms, thus undermining a number of epistemological and linguistic arguments for behaviorism (Fodor and Chihara 1965, Fodor 1968). Perhaps more importantly, Fodor argued that theories in cognitive psychology and linguistics provide a powerful argument against behaviorism, since they posit the existence of various mental events that are not definable in terms of, or otherwise logically connected to, overt behavior (Fodor 1968, 1975). Along with the arguments of Putnam (1963, 1967) and Chomsky (1959), among others, Fodor’s early arguments against behaviorism were an important step in the development of the then emerging cognitive sciences.

Central to this development was the rise of functionalism as a genuine alternative to behaviorism, and Fodor’s Psychological Explanation (1968) was one of the first in-depth treatments and defenses of this view (see also Putnam 1963, 1967). Unlike behaviorism, which attempts to explain behavior in terms of law-like relationships between stimulus inputs and behavioral outputs, functionalism posits that such explanations will appeal to internal properties that mediate between inputs and outputs. Indeed, the main claim of functionalism is that mental properties are individuated in terms of the various causal relations they enter into, where such relations are not restricted to mere input-output relations, but also include their relations to a host of other properties that figure in the relevant empirical theories. Although, at the time, the distinctions between various forms of functionalism weren’t as clear as they are now, Fodor’s brand of functionalism is a version of what is now known as “psycho-functionalism”. On this view, what determines the relations that define mental properties are the deliverances of empirical psychology, and not, say, the platitudes of commonsense psychology, what can be known a priori about mental properties, or the analyticities expressive of the meanings of mental expressions; see Rey (1997, ch.7) and Shoemaker (2003) for discussion.

By defining mental properties in terms of their causal roles, functionalists allow for different kinds of physical phenomena to satisfy these relations. Functionalism thus goes hand in hand with multiple realizability. In other words, if a given mental property, M, is a functional property that’s defined by a specific causal condition, C, then any number of distinct physical properties, P1, P2, P3… Pn, may each “realize” M provided that each property meets C. Functionalism thereby characterizes mental properties at a level of abstraction that ignores differences in the physical structure of the systems that have these properties. Early functionalists, like Fodor and Putnam, thus took themselves to be articulating a position that was distinct not only from behaviorism, but also from type-identity theory, which identifies mental properties with neurophysiological properties of the brain. If functionalism implies that mental properties can be realized by different physical properties in different kinds of systems (or the same system over time), then functionalism precludes identifying mental properties with physical properties.

Fodor’s functionalism, in particular, was articulated so that it was seen to have sweeping consequences for debates concerning reductionism and the unity of science. In his seminal essay “Special Sciences” (1974), Fodor spells out a metaphysical picture of the special sciences that eventually came to be called “non-reductive physicalism”. This picture is physicalist in that it accepts what Fodor calls the “generality of physics,” which is the claim that every event that falls under a special science predicate also falls under a physical predicate, but not vice versa. It’s non-reductionist in that it denies that “the special sciences should reduce to physical theories in the long run” (1974, p. 97). Traditionally, reductionists sought to articulate bridge laws that link special science predicates with physical predicates, either in the form of bi-conditionals or identity statements. Fodor argues not only that the generality of physics does not require the existence of bridge laws, but that in general such laws will be unavailable given that the events picked out by special science predicates will be “wildly disjunctive” from the perspective of physics (1974, p. 103). Multiple realizability thus guarantees that special science predicates will cross-classify phenomena picked out by purely physical predicates. This, in turn, undermines the reductionist hope of a unified science whereby the higher-level theories of the special sciences reduce to lower-level theories and ultimately to fundamental physics. On Fodor’s picture, then, the special sciences are “autonomous” in that they articulate irreducible generalizations that quantify over irreducible and casually efficacious higher-level properties (1974; see also 1998b, ch.2).

Functionalism and non-reductive physicalism are now commonplace in philosophy of mind, and provide the backdrop for many contemporary debates about psychological explanation, laws, multiple realizability, mental causation, and more. This is something for which Fodor surely deserves much of the credit (or blame, depending on one’s view; see Kim (1993) and Heil (2003) for criticisms of the metaphysical underpinnings of non-reductive physicalism).

3. Intentional Realism

A central aim of Fodor’s work has been to defend folk psychology as at least the starting point for a serious scientific psychology. At a minimum, folk psychology is committed to two kinds of states: belief-like states, which represent the environment and guide one’s behavior, and desire-like states, which represent one’s goals and motivate behavior. We routinely appeal to such states in our common-sense explanations of people’s behavior.  For example, we explain why John walked to the store in terms of his desire for milk and his belief that there’s milk for sale at the store. Fodor is impressed by the remarkable predictive power of such belief-desire explanations. The following passage is typical:

Common sense psychology works so well it disappears. It’s like those mythical Rolls Royce cars whose engines are sealed when they leave the factory; only it’s better because they aren’t mythical. Someone I don’t know phones me at my office in New York from—as it might be—Arizona. ‘Would you like to lecture here next Tuesday?’ are the words he utters. ‘Yes thank you. I’ll be at your airport on the 3 p.m. flight’ are the words that I reply. That’s all that happens, but it’s more than enough; the rest of the burden of predicting behavior—of bridging the gap between utterances and actions—is routinely taken up by the theory. And the theory works so well that several days later (or weeks later, or months later, or years later; you can vary the example to taste) and several thousand miles away, there I am at the airport and there he is to meet me. Or if I don’t turn up, it’s less likely that the theory failed than that something went wrong with the airline. … The theory from which we get this extraordinary predictive power is just good old common sense belief/desire psychology. … If we could do that well with predicting the weather, no one would ever get his feet wet; and yet the etiology of the weather must surely be child’s play compared with the causes of behavior. (1987, pp. 3-4)

Passages like this may suggest that Fodor’s intentional realism is wedded to the folk-psychological categories of “belief” and “desire”. But this isn’t so. Rather, Fodor’s claim is that there are certain core elements of folk psychology that will be shared by a mature scientific psychology. In particular, a mature psychology will posit states with the following features:

(1)  They will be intentional: they will be “about” things and they will be semantically evaluable. (In the way that the belief that Obama is President is about Obama, and can be semantically evaluated as true or false.)

(2)  They will be causally efficacious, figuring in genuine causal explanations and laws.

Fodor’s intentional realism thus doesn’t require that the folk-psychological categories themselves find a place in a mature psychology. Indeed, Fodor has suggested that the individuation conditions for beliefs are “so vague and pragmatic” that it’s doubtful they’re fit for empirical psychology (1990, p. 175). What Fodor is committed to is the claim that a mature psychology will be intentional through and through, and that the intentional states it posits will be causally implicated in law-like explanations of human behavior. Exactly which intentional states will figure in a mature psychology is a matter to be decided by empirical inquiry, not by a priori reflection on our common sense understanding.

Fodor’s defense of intentional realism is usefully viewed as part of a rationalist tradition that stresses the human mind’s striking sensitivity to indefinitely many arbitrary properties of the world. We’re sensitive not only to abstract properties such as being a democracy and being virtuous, but also to abstract grammatical properties such as being a noun phrase and being a verb phrase, as well as to such arbitrary properties as being a tiny folded piece of paper, being an oddly-shaped canteen, being a crumpled shirt, and being to the left of my favorite mug. On Fodor’s view, something can selectively respond to such properties only if it’s an intentional system capable of manipulating representations of these properties.

Of course, there are many physical systems that are responsive to environmental properties ( thermometers, paramecia) that we would not wish to count as intentional systems. Fodor’s own proposal for what distinguishes intentional systems from the rest is that only intentional systems are sensitive to “non-nomic” properties, that is, the properties of objects that do not determine that they fall under any laws of nature (Fodor 1986). Consider Fodor’s example of the property of being a crumpled shirt. Although laws govern crumpled shirts, no object is subsumed under a law in virtue of being a crumpled shirt. Nevertheless, the property of being a crumpled shirt is one that we can represent an object as having, and such representations do enter into laws of nature. For instance, there’s presumably a law-like relationship between my noticing the crumpled shirt, my desire to remark upon it, and my saying “there’s a crumpled shirt”. On Fodor’s view the job of intentional psychology is to articulate the laws governing mental representations, which figure in genuine causal explanations of people’s behavior (Fodor 1987, 1998a).

Although positing mental representations that have semantic and causal properties— states that satisfy (1) and (2) above—may not seem particularly controversial, the existence of causally efficacious intentional states has been denied by all manner of behaviorists, epiphenomenalists, Wittgensteinians, interpretationists, instrumentalists, and (at least some) connectionists. Much of Fodor’s work has been devoted to defending intentional realism against such views as they have arisen in both philosophy and psychology. In addition to defending intentional realism against the behaviorism of Skinner and Ryle (Fodor 1968, 1975, Fodor et al. 1974), Fodor has also defended it against the threat of epiphenomenalism (Fodor 1989), against Wittgenstein and other defenders of the “private language argument” (Fodor and Chihara 1965, Fodor 1975), against the eliminativism of the Churchlands (Fodor 1987, 1990), against the instrumentalism of Dennett (Fodor 1981a, Fodor and Lepore 1992), against the interpretationism of Davidson (Fodor 1990, Fodor and Lepore 1992, Fodor 2004), and against certain versions of connectionism (Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988, Fodor and McLaughlin 1990, Fodor 1998b).

Even if Fodor is right that there are intentional states that satisfy (1) and (2), there’s still the question of how such states can exist in a physical world. Intentional realists must explain, for instance, how lawful relations between intentional states can be understood physicalistically. This is particularly pressing, since at least some intentional laws describe rational relations between the intentional states they quantify over, and, ever since Descartes, philosophers have worried about how a purely physical system could exhibit rational relations (see Lowe (2008) for recent skepticism from a non-Cartesian dualist). Fodor’s Representational Theory of Mind is his attempt to answer such worries.

4. The Representational Theory of Mind

As Fodor points out, RTM is “really a loose confederation of theses” that “lacks, to put it mildly, a canonical formulation” (1998a, p. 6). At its core, though, RTM is an attempt to combine Alan Turing’s work on computation with intentional realism (as outlined above). Broadly speaking, RTM claims that mental processes are computational processes, and that intentional states are relations to mental representations that serve as the domain of such processes. On Fodor’s version of RTM, these mental representations have both syntactic structure and a compositional semantics. Thinking thus takes place in an internal language of thought.

Turing showed us how to construct a purely mechanical device that could transform syntactically-individuated symbols in such a way as to respect the semantic relations that exist between the meanings, or contents, of those symbols. Formally valid inferences are the paradigm. For instance, modus ponens can be realized on a machine that’s sensitive only to syntactic properties of symbols. The device thus doesn’t have “access” to the symbols’ semantic properties, but can nevertheless transform the symbols in a truth-preserving way. What’s interesting about this, from Fodor’s perspective, is that, at least sometimes, mental processes also involve chains of thoughts that are truth-preserving. As Fodor puts it:

[I]f you start out with a true thought, and you proceed to do some thinking, it is very often the case that the thoughts that thinking leads you to will also be true. This is, in my view, the most important fact we know about minds; no doubt it’s why God bothered to give us any. (1994, p. 9; see also 1987, pp. 12-14, 2000, p. 18)

In order to account for this “most important” fact, RTM claims that thoughts themselves are syntactically-structured representations, and that mental processes are computational processes defined over them. Given that the syntax of a representation is what determines its causal role in thought, RTM thereby serves to connect the fact that mental processes are truth-preserving with the fact that they’re causal.

For instance, suppose a thinker believes that if John ran, then Mary swam. According to RTM, for a thinker to hold such a belief is for the thinker to stand in a certain computational relation to a mental representation that means if John ran, then Mary swam. Now suppose the thinker comes to believe that John ran, and as a result comes to believe that Mary swam. RTM has it that the causal relations between these thoughts hold in virtue of the syntactic form of the underlying mental representations. By picturing the mind as a “syntax-driven machine” (Fodor, 1987, p. 20), RTM thus promises to explain how the causal relations among thoughts can respect rational relations among their contents. It thereby provides a potentially promising reply to Descartes’ worry about how rationality could be exhibited by a mere machine. As Fodor puts it:

So we can now (maybe) explain how thinking could be both rational and mechanical. Thinking can be rational because syntactically specified operations can be truth preserving insofar as they reconstruct relations of logical form; thinking can be mechanical because Turing machines are machines. … [T]his really is a lovely idea and we should pause for a moment to admire it. Rationality is a normative property; that is, it’s one that a mental process ought to have. This is the first time that there has ever been a remotely plausible mechanical theory of the causal powers of a normative property. The first time ever. (2000, p. 29)

In Fodor’s view, it’s a major argument in favor of RTM that it promises an explanation of how mental processes can be truth-preserving (Fodor 1994, p. 9; 2000, p. 13), and a major strike against traditional empiricist and associationist theories that they offer no competing explanation (1998a, p. 10; 2000, pp. 15-18; 2003, pp. 90-94).

That it explains how truth-preserving mental processes could be realized causally is one of Fodor’s main arguments for RTM. In addition, Fodor argues that RTM provides the only hope of explaining the so-called “productivity” and “systematicity” of thought (Fodor 1987, 1998a, 2008). Roughly, productivity is the feature of our minds whereby there is no upper bound to the number of thoughts we can entertain. We can think that the dog is on the deck; that the dog, which chased the squirrel, is on the deck; that the dog, which chased the squirrel, which foraged for nuts, is on the deck; and so on, indefinitely. There are, of course, thoughts whose contents are so long that other factors prevent us from entertaining them. But abstracting away from such performance limitations, it seems that a theory of our conceptual competence must account for such productivity. Thought also appears to be systematic, in the following sense: a mind that is capable of entertaining a certain thought, p, is also capable of entertaining logical permutations of p. For example, minds that can entertain the thought that the book is to the left of the cup can also entertain the thought that the cup is to the left of the book. Although it’s perhaps possible that there could be minds that  do not exhibit such systematicity—a possibility denied by some, for example, Evans (1982) and Peacocke (1992)—it at least appears to be an empirical fact that all minds do.

In Fodor’s view, RTM is the only theory of mind that can explain productivity and systematicity. According to RTM, mental states have internal, constituent structure, and the content of mental states is determined by the content of their constituents and how those constituents are put together. Given a finite base of primitive representations, our capacity to entertain endlessly many thoughts can be explained by positing a finite number of rules for combining representations, which can be applied endlessly many times in the course of constructing complex thoughts. RTM offers a similar explanation of systematicity. The reason that a mind that can entertain the thought that the book is to the left of the cup can also entertain the thought that the cup is to the left of the book, is that these thoughts are built up out of the same constituents, using the same rules of combination. RTM thus explains productivity and systematicity because it claims that mental states are relations to representations that have syntactic structure and a compositional semantics. One of Fodor’s main arguments against alternative, connectionist theories is that they fail to account for such features (Fodor and Pylyshyn 1988, Fodor 1998b, chs. 9 and10).

A further argument Fodor offers in favor of RTM is that successful empirical theories of various non-demonstrative inferences presuppose a system of internal representations in which such inferences are carried out. For instance, standard theories of visual perception attempt to explain how a percept is constructed on the basis of the physical information available and the visual system’s built-in assumptions about the environment, or “natural constraints” (Pylyshyn 2003). Similarly, theories of sentence perception and comprehension require that the language system be able to represent distinct properties (for instance, acoustic, phonological, and syntactic properties) of a single utterance (Fodor et al. 1974). Both sorts of theories require that there be a system of representations capable of representing various properties and serving as the medium in which such inferences are carried out. Indeed, Fodor sometimes claims that the best reason for endorsing RTM is that “some version or other of RTM underlies practically all current psychological research on mentation, and our best science is ipso facto our best estimate of what there is and what it’s made of” (Fodor 1987, p. 17). Fodor’s The Language of Thought (1975) is the locus classicus of this style of argument.

5. Content and Concepts

Even if taking mental processes to be computational shows how rational relations between thoughts can be realized by purely casual relations among symbols in the brain, as RTM suggests, there’s still the question of how those symbols come to have their meaning or content. Ever since Brentano, philosophers have worried about how to integrate intentionality into the physical world, a worry that has famously led some to accept the “baselessness of intentional idioms and the emptiness of a science of intention” (Quine 1960, p. 221). Part of Fodor’s task is thus to show, contra his eliminativist, instrumentalist, and interpretationist opponents, that a plausible naturalistic account of intentionality can be given. Much of his work over the last two decades or so has focused on this representational (as opposed to the computational) component of RTM (Fodor 1987, 1994, 1998; Fodor and Lepore 1992, 2002).

Back in the 1960s and early 1970s, Fodor endorsed a version of so-called “inferential role semantics” (IRS), according to which the content of a representation is (partially) determined by the inferential connections that it bears to other representations. To take two hoary examples, IRS has it that “bachelor” gets its meaning, in part, by bearing an inferential connection to “unmarried,” and “kill” gets its meaning, in part, by bearing an inferential connection to “die”. Such inferential connections hold, on Fodor’s early view, because “bachelor” and “kill” have complex structure at the level at which they’re semantically interpreted— that is, they have the structure exhibited by the phrases “unmarried adult male” and “cause to die” (Katz and Fodor 1963). In terms of concepts, the claim is that the concept BACHELOR has the internal structure exhibited by ‘UNMARRIED ADULT MALE’, and the concept KILL has the internal structure exhibited by ‘CAUSE TO DIE’. (This article follows the convention of writing the names of concepts in capitals and writing the meanings of concepts in italics.)

Eventually, Fodor came to think that there are serious objections to IRS. Some of these objections were based on his own experimental work in psycholinguistics, which he took to provide strong evidence against the existence of complex lexical structure. Understanding a sentence does not seem to involve recovering the decompositions of the lexical items they contain (Fodor et al. 1975). Thinking the thought CATS CHASE MICE doesn’t seem to be harder than thinking CATS CATCH MICE, whereas the former ought to be more complex if ‘chase’ can be decomposed into a structure that includes ‘intends to catch’ (Fodor et al. 1980). As Fodor recently quipped, “[i]t’s an iron law of cognitive science that, in experimental environments, definitions always behave exactly as though they weren’t there” (1998a, p. 46). (For an alternative interpretation of this evidence, see Jackendoff (1983, pp. 125-127; 1992, p. 49), and Miller and Johnson-Laird (1976, p. 328).) In part because of the lack of evidence for decompositional structure, Fodor at one point seriously considered the view the inferential connections among lexical items may hold in virtue of inference rules, or “meaning postulates,” which renders IRS consistent with a denial of the claim that lexical items are semantically structured (1975, pp. 148-152).

However, Fodor ultimately became convinced of Quine’s influential arguments against meaning postulates, and more generally, Quine’s view that there is no principled distinction between those connections that are “constitutive” of the meaning of a concept and those that are “merely collateral”. Quinean considerations, Fodor argues, show that IRS theorists should not appeal to meaning postulates (Fodor 1998a, appendix 5a). Moreover, Quine’s confirmation holism suggests that the epistemic properties of a concept are potentially connected to the epistemic properties of every other concept, which, according to Fodor, suggests that IRS inevitably leads to semantic holism, the claim that all of a concept’s inferential connections are constitutive. But Fodor argues that semantic holism is unacceptable, since it’s incompatible with the claim that concepts are shareable. As he recently put it, “since practically everybody has some eccentric beliefs about practically everything, holism has it that nobody shares any concepts with anybody else” (2004, p. 35; see also Fodor and Lepore 1992, Fodor 1998a). This implication would undermine the possibility of genuine intentional generalizations in psychology, which require that concepts are shared across both individuals and different time-slices of the same individual.

Proponents of IRS might reply to these concerns about semantic holism by claiming that only some inferential connections are concept-constitutive. But Fodor suggests that the only way to distinguish the constitutive connections from the rest is to endorse an analytic/synthetic distinction, which in his view Quine has given us good reason to reject (for example, 1990, p. x, 1998a, p. 71, 1998b, pp. 32-33). Fodor’s Quinean point, ultimately, is that theorists should be reluctant to claim that there are certain beliefs people must hold, or inferences they must accept, in order to possess a concept. For thinkers can apparently have any number of arbitrarily strange beliefs involving some concept, consistent with them sharing that concept with others. As Fodor puts it:

[P]eople can have radically false theories and really crazy views, consonant with our understanding perfectly well, thank you, which false views they have and what radically crazy things it is that they believe. Berkeley thought that chairs are mental, for Heaven’s sake! Which are we to say he lacked, the concept MENTAL or the concept CHAIR? (1987, p. 125) (For further reflections along similar lines, see Williamson 2007.)

Without an analytic/synthetic distinction, any attempt to answer such a question would be unprincipled. Rejecting the analytic/synthetic distinction thus leads Fodor to reject any ‘molecularist’ attempt to specify only certain inferences or beliefs as concept-constitutive. On Fodor’s view, then, proponents of IRS are faced with two unequally satisfying options: they can agree with Quine about the analytic/synthetic distinction, but at the cost of endorsing semantic holism and its unpalatable consequences for the viability of intentionality psychology; or they can deny semantic holism at the cost of endorsing an analytic/synthetic distinction, which Fodor thinks nobody knows how to draw.

It’s worth pointing out that Fodor doesn’t think that confirmation holism, all by itself, rules out the existence of certain “local” semantic connections that hold as a matter of empirical fact. Indeed, contemporary battles over the existence of such connections are now taking place on explanatory grounds that involve delicate psychological and linguistic considerations that are fairly far removed from the epistemological considerations that motivated the positivists. For instance, there are the standard convergences in people’s semantic-cum-conceptual intuitions, which cry out for an empirical explanation. Although some argue that such convergences are best explained by positing analyticities ( Grice and Strawson 1956, Rey 2005), Fodor argues that all such intuitions can be accounted for by an appeal to Quinean “centrality” or “one-criterion” concepts (Fodor 1998a, pp. 80-86). There are also considerations in linguistics that bear on the existence of an empirically grounded analytic/synthetic distinction including issues concerning the syntactic and semantic analyses of ‘causative’ verbs, the ‘generativity’ of the lexicon, and the acquisition of certain elements of syntax. Fodor has engaged linguists on a number of such fronts, arguing against the proposals of Jackendoff (1992), Pustejovsky (1995), Pinker (1989), Hale and Keyser (1993), and others, defending the Quinean line (see Fodor 1998a, pp. 49-56, and Fodor and Lepore 2002, chs. 5-6; see Pustejovsky 1998 and Hale and Keyser 1999 for rejoinders). Fodor’s view is that all of the relevant empirical facts about minds and language can be explained without any analytic connections, but merely deeply believed ones, precisely as Quine argued.

Fodor sees a common error to all versions of IRS because they are trying to tie semantics to epistemology. Moreover, the problems plaguing IRS ultimately arise as a result of its attempt to connect a theory of meaning with certain epistemic conditions of thinkers. A further argument against such views, Fodor claims, is that such epistemic conditions do not compose, since they violate the compositionality constraint that is required for an explanation of productivity and systematicity (see above). For instance, if one believes that brown cows are dangerous, then the concept BROWN COW will license the inference ‘BROWN COW → DANGEROUS’; but this inference is not determined by the inferential roles of BROWN and COW, which it ought to be if meaning-constituting inferences are compositional (Fodor and Lepore 2002, ch.1; for discussion and criticism, see, for example, Block 1993, Boghossian 1993, and Rey 1993).

Another epistemic approach, as favored by many psychologists, appeals to “prototypes”. According to these theories, lexical concepts are internally structured and specify the prototypical features of their instances, that is, the features that they’re instances tend to (but need not) have (for examples see Rosch and Mervis 1975). Prototype theories are epistemic accounts because having a concept is a matter of knowing the features of its prototypical instances. Given this, Fodor argues that prototype theories are in danger of violating compositionality. For example, knowing what prototypical pets ('dogs') are like and what prototypical fish ('trout') are like does not guarantee that you know what prototypical pet fish ('goldfish') are like (Fodor 1998a, pp. 102-108, Fodor and Lepore 2002, ch. 2). Since compositionality is required in order to explain the productivity and systematicity of thought, and prototype structures do not compose, it follows that concepts don’t have prototype structure. According to Fodor, the same kind argument applies to theories that take concepts to be individuated by certain recognitional capacities. Fodor argues that since recognitional capacities don’t compose, but concepts do, “there are no recognitional concepts—not even red” (Fodor 1998b, ch. 4). This argument has been disputed by a number of philosophers, for example, Horgan (1998), Recanati (2002), and Prinz (2002).

Fodor thus rejects all theories that individuate concepts in terms of their epistemic relations and their internal structure, and instead defends what he calls “informational atomism,” according to which lexical concepts are unstructured atoms whose content is determined by certain informational relations they bear to phenomena in the environment. In claiming that lexical concepts are internally unstructured, Fodor’s informational atomism is meant to respect the evidence and arguments against decomposition, definitions, prototypes, and the like. In claiming that none of the epistemic properties of concepts are constitutive, Fodor is endorsing what he sees as the only alternative to a molecularist and holistic theory of content, neither of which he takes to be viable. By separating epistemology from semantics in this way, Fodor’s theory places virtually no constraints on what a thinker must believe in order to possess a particular concept. For instance, what determines whether a mind possesses DOG isn’t whether it has certain beliefs about dogs, but rather whether it possess an internal symbol that stands in the appropriate mind-world relation to the property of being a dog. Rather than talking about concepts as they figure in beliefs, inferences, or other epistemic states, Fodor instead talks of mere “tokenings” of concepts, where for him these are internal symbols that need not play any specific role in cognition. In his view, this is the only way for a theory of concepts to respect Quinean strictures on analyticity and constitutive conceptual connections. Indeed, Fodor claims that by denying that “the grasp of any interconceptual relations is constitutive of concept possession,” informational atomism allows us to “see why Quine was right about there not being an analytic/synthetic distinction” (Fodor 1998a, p. 71).

Fodor’s most explicit characterization of the mind-world relation that determines content is his “asymmetry dependency” theory (1987, 1990). According to this theory, the concept DOG means dog because dogs cause tokenings of DOG, and non-dogs causing tokenings of DOG is asymmetrically dependent upon dogs causing DOG. In other words, non-dogs wouldn’t cause tokenings of DOG unless dogs cause tokenings of DOG, but not vice versa. This is Fodor’s attempt to meet Brentano’s challenge of providing a naturalistic sufficient condition for a symbol to have a meaning. Not surprisingly, many objections have been raised to Fodor’s asymmetric dependency theory (seethe papers in Loewer in Rey 1991), and it’s interesting to note that the theory has all but disappeared from his more recent work on concepts and content, in which he simply claims that “meaning is information (more or less)”, without specifying the nature of the relations that determine the informational content of a symbol (1998a, p. 12).

Regardless of the exact nature of the content-determining laws, it’s important to see that Fodor is not claiming that the epistemic properties of concept are irrelevant from the perspective of a theory of concepts. For such epistemic properties are what sustain the laws that “lock” concepts onto properties in the environment. For instance, it is only because thinkers know a range of facts about dogs—what they look like, that they bark, and so forth—that their dog-tokens are lawfully connected to the property of being a dog. Knowledge of such facts plays a causal role in fixing the content of DOG, but on Fodor’s view they don’t play a constitutive one. For while such epistemic properties mediate the connection between tokens of DOG and dogs, this a mere “engineering” fact about us, which has no implications for the metaphysics of concepts or concept possession (1998a, p. 78). As Fodor puts it, “it’s that your mental structures contrive to resonate to doghood, not how your mental structures contrive to resonate to doghood, that is constitutive of concept possession” (1998a, p. 76). Although the internal relations that DOG bears to other concepts and to percepts are what mediate the connection between DOG and dogs, such relations are not concept-constitutive.

Fodor’s theory is thus a version of semantic externalism, according to which the meaning of a concept is exhausted by its reference. There are two well-known problems with any such theory: Frege cases, which putatively show that concepts that have different meanings can nevertheless be referentially identical; and Twin cases, which putatively show that concepts that are referentially distinct can nevertheless have the same meaning. Together, Frege cases and Twin cases suggest that meaning and reference are independent in both directions. Fodor has had much to say about each kind of case, and his views on both have changed over the years.

If conceptual content is exhausted by reference, then two concepts with the same referent ought to be identical in content. As Fodor puts it, “if meaning is information, then coreferential representations must be synonyms” (1998a, p. 12). But, prima facie, this is false. For as Frege pointed out, it’s easy to generate substitution failures involving coreferential concepts: “John believes that Hesperus is beautiful” may be true while “John believes that Phosphorus is beautiful” is false; “Thales believes that there’s water in the cup” may be true while “Thales believes that there’s H2O in the cup” is false; and so on. Since it’s widely believed that substitution tests are tests for synonymy, such cases suggest that coreferential concepts aren’t synonyms. In light of this, Fregeans introduce a layer of meaning in addition to reference that allows for a semantic distinction between coreferential but distinct concepts. On their view, coreferential concepts are distinct because they have different senses, or “modes of presentation” of a referent, which Fregeans typically individuate in terms of conceptual role (Peacocke 1992).

In one of Fodor’s important early articles on the topic, “Methodological Solipsism Considered as a Research Strategy in Cognitive Psychology” (1980), he argued that psychological explanations depend upon opaque taxonomies of mental states, and that we must distinguish the content of coreferential terms for the purposes of psychological explanation. At that time Fodor thus allowed for a kind of content that’s determined by the internal roles of symbols, which he speculated might be “reconstructed as aspects of form, at least insofar as appeals to content figure in accounts of the mental causation of behavior” (1981, p. 240). However, once he adopted a purely externalist semantics (Fodor 1994), Fodor could no longer allow for a notion of content determined by such internal relations. If conceptual content is exhausted by reference, as informational semantics has it, then there cannot be a semantic distinction between coreferential but distinct concepts.

In later work Fodor thus proposes to distinguish coreferential concepts purely syntactically, and argues that we treat modes of presentation (MOPs) as the representational vehicles of thoughts (Fodor 1994, 1998a, 2008). For instance, while Thales’ ‘water-MOP’ has the same content as his ‘H2O-MOP’ (were he to have one), they are nevertheless syntactically distinct (for example, only the latter has hydrogen as a constituent), and will thus differ in the causal and inferential relations they enter into. In taking MOPs to be the syntactically-individuated vehicles of thought, Fodor’s treatment of Frege cases serves to connect his theory of concepts with RTM. As he puts it:

It’s really the basic idea of RTM that Turing’s story about the nature of mental processes provides the very candidates for MOP-hood that Frege’s story about the individuation of mental states independently requires. If that’s true, it’s about the nicest thing that ever happened to cognitive science (1998a, p. 22).

An interesting consequence of this treatment is that people’s behavior in Frege cases can no longer be given an intentional explanation. Instead, such behavior is explained at the level of syntactically-individuated representations If, as Fodor suggested in his early work (1981), psychological explanations standardly depend upon opaque taxonomies of mental states, then this treatment of Frege cases would threaten the need for intentional explanations in psychology. In an attempt to block this threat, Fodor (1994) argues that Frege cases are in fact quite rare, and can be understood as exceptions rather than counterexamples to psychological laws couched in terms of broad content. The viability of a view that combines a syntactic treatment of Frege cases with RTM has been the focus of a fair amount of recent literature; see Arjo (1997), Aydede (1998), Aydede and Robins (2001), Brook and Stainton (1997), Rives (2009), Segal (1997), and Schneider (2005).

Let us now turn to Fodor’s treatment of Twin cases. Putnam (1975) asks us to imagine a place, Twin Earth, which is just like earth except the stuff Twin Earthians pick out with the concept water is not H2O but some other chemical compound XYZ. Consider Oscar and Twin Oscar, who are both entertaining the thought there’s water in the glass. Since they’re physical duplicates, they’re type-identical with respect to everything mental inside their heads. However, Oscar’s thought is true just in case there’s H2O in the glass, whereas Twin Oscar’s thought is true just in case there’s XYZ in the glass. A purely externalist semantics thus seems to imply that Oscar and Twin Oscar’s WATER concepts are of distinct types, despite the fact that Oscar and Twin Oscar are type-identical with respect to everything mental inside their heads. Supposing that intentional laws are couched in terms of broad content, it would follow that Oscar’s and Twin Oscar’s water-directed behavior don’t fall under the same intentional laws.

Such consequence have seemed unacceptable to many, including Fodor, who in his book Psychosemantics (1987) argues that we need a notion of “narrow” content that allows us to account for the fact that Oscar’s and Twin-Oscar’s mental states will have the same causal powers despite differences in their environments. Fodor there defends a “mapping” notion of narrow content, inspired by David Kaplan’s work on demonstratives, according to which the narrow content of a concept is a function from contexts to broad contents (1987, ch. 2). The narrow content of Oscar’s and Twin Oscar’s concept WATER is thus a function that maps Oscar’s context onto the broad content H2O and Twin Oscar’s context onto the broad content XYZ. Such narrow content is shared because Oscar and Twin Oscar are computing the same function. It was Fodor’s hope that this notion of narrow content would allow him to respect the standard Twin-Earth intuitions, while at the same time claim that the intentional properties relevant for psychological explanation supervene on facts internal to thinkers.

However, in The Elm and the Expert (1994) Fodor gives up on the notion of narrow content altogether, and argues that intentional psychology need not worry about Twin cases. Such cases, Fodor claims, only show that it’s conceptually (not nomologically) possible that broad content doesn’t supervene on facts internal to thinkers. One thus can not appeal to such cases to “argue against the nomological supervenience of broad content on computation since, as far as anybody knows … chemistry allows nothing that is as much like water as XYZ is supposed to be except water” (1994, p. 28). So since Putnam’s Twin Earth is nomologically impossible, and “empirical theories are responsible only to generalizations that hold in nomologically possible worlds,” Twin cases pose no threat to a broad content psychology (1994, p. 29). If it turned out that such cases did occur, then, according to Fodor, the generalizations missed by a broad content psychology would be purely accidental (1994, pp. 30-33). Fodor’s settled view is thus that Twin cases, like Frege cases, cases are fully compatible with an intentional psychology that posits only two dimensions to concepts: syntactically-individuated internal representations and broad contents.

6. Nativism

In The Language of Thought (1975), Fodor argued not only in favor of RTM but also in favor of the much more controversial view that all lexical concepts are innate. Fodor’s argument starts with the noncontroversial claim that in order to learn a concept one must learn its meaning, or content. Empiricist models of concept learning typically assume that thinkers learn a concept on the basis of experience by confirming a hypothesis about its meaning. But Fodor argues that such models will apply only to those concepts whose meanings are semantically complex. For instance, if the meaning of BACHELOR is unmarried, adult, male, then a thinker can learn bachelor by confirming the hypothesis that it applies to things that are unmarried, adult, and male. Of course, being able to formulate this hypothesis requires that one possess the concepts UNMARRIED, ADULT, and MALE. The empiricist model thus will not apply to primitive concepts that lack internal structure that can be mentally represented in this way. For instance, one can not formulate the hypothesis that red things fall under RED unless one already has RED, for the concept RED is a constituent of that very hypothesis. Primitive concepts like RED, therefore, must not be learned and must be innate. If, as Fodor argues, all lexical concepts are primitive, then it follows that all lexical concepts are innate (1975, ch. 2). Fodor’s claim is not that people are born possessing lexical concepts; experience must play a role on any account of concept acquisition (just as it does on any account of language acquisition). Fodor’s claim is that concepts are not learned on the basis of experience, but rather are triggered by it. As Fodor sometimes puts it, the relation between experience and concept acquisition is brute-causal, not rational or evidential (Fodor 1981b).

Of course, most theories of concepts—such as inferential role and prototype theories, discussed above—assume that many lexical concepts have some kind of internal structure. In fact, theorists are sometimes explicit that their motivation for positing complex lexical structure is to reduce the number of primitives in the lexicon. As Ray Jackendoff says:

Nearly everyone thinks that learning anything consists of constructing it from previously known parts, using previously known means of combination. If we trace the learning process back and ask where the previously known parts came from, and their previously know parts came from, eventually we have to arrive at a point where the most basic parts are not learned: they are given to the learner genetically, by virtue of the character of brain development. … Applying this view to lexical learning, we conclude that lexical concepts must have a compositional structure, and that the word learner’s [functional]-mind is putting meanings together from smaller parts (2002, 334). (See also Levin and Pinker 1991, p. 4.)

It’s worth stressing that while those in the empiricist tradition typically assume that the primitives are sensory concepts, those who posit complex lexical structure need not commit themselves to any such claim. Rather, they may simply assume that very few lexical items are not decomposable, and deal with the issue of primitives on a case by case basis, as Jackendoff (2002) does. In fact, many of the (apparent) primitives appealed to in the literature—for example, EVENT, THING, STATE, CAUSE, and so forth—are quite abstract and thus not ripe for an empiricist treatment.

In any case, Fodor is led to adopt informational atomism, in part, because he isn’t persuaded by the evidence that lexical concepts have any structure, decompositional or otherwise. He thus does not think that appealing to lexical structure provides an adequate reply to his argument for concept nativism (Fodor 1981b, 1998a, Fodor and Lepore 2002). If lexical concepts are primitive, and primitive concepts are unlearned, then lexical concepts are unlearned.

In his book Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong (1998a), Fodor worries about whether his earlier view is adequate. In particular, he’s concerned about whether it has the resources to explain questions such as why it is experiences with doorknobs that trigger the concept DOORKNOB:

[T]here’s a further constraint that whatever theory of concepts we settle on should satisfy: it must explain why there is so generally a content relation between the experience that eventuates in concept attainment and the concept that the experience eventuates in attaining. … [A]ssuming that primitive concepts are triggered, or that they’re ‘caught’, won’t account for their content relation to their causes; apparently only induction will. But primitive concepts can’t be induced; to suppose that they are is circular. (1998a, p. 132

Fodor’s answer to this worry involves a metaphysical claim about the nature of the properties picked out by most of our lexical concepts. In particular, he claims that it’s constitutive of these properties that our minds “lock” to them as a result of experience with their stereotypical instances. As Fodor puts it, being a doorknob is just “being the kind of thing that our kinds of minds (do or would) lock to from experience with instances of the doorknob stereotype” (1998a, p. 137). By making such properties mind-dependent in this way, Fodor thus provides a metaphysical reply to his worry above: there need not be a cognitive or evidential relation between our experiences with doorknobs and our acquisition of DOORKNOB, for being a doorknob just is the property that our minds lock to as a result of experiencing stereotypical instances of doorknobs. Fodor sums up his view as follows:

[I]f the locking story about concept possession and the mind-dependence story about the metaphysics of doorknobhood are both true, then the kind of nativism about doorknob that an informational atomist has to put up with is perhaps not one of concepts but of mechanisms. That consequence may be some consolation to otherwise disconsolate Empiricists. (1998a, p. 142)

In his recent book, LOT 2: The Language of Thought Revisited (2008), Fodor extends his earlier discussions of concept nativism. Whereas his previous argument turned on the empirical claim that lexical concepts are internally unstructured, Fodor now says that this claim is “superfluous”: “What I should have said is that it’s true and a priori that the whole notion of concept learning is per se confused” (2008, p. 130). Fodor thus argues that even patently complex concepts, such as GREEN OR TRIANGULAR, are unlearnable. Learning this concept would require confirming the hypothesis that the things that fall under it are either green or triangular. However, Fodor says:

[T]he inductive evaluation of that hypothesis itself requires (inter alia) bringing the property green or triangular before the mind as such. You can’t represent something as green or triangular unless have the concepts GREEN, OR, and TRIANGULAR. Quite generally, you can’t represent anything as such as such unless you already have the concept such and such. … This conclusion is entirely general; it doesn’t matter whether the target concept is primitive (like green) or complex (like GREEN OR TRIANGULAR). (2008, p. 139)

Fodor’s diagnosis of this problem is that standard learning models wrongly assume that acquiring a concept is a matter of acquiring beliefs Instead, Fodor suggests that “beliefs are constructs out of concepts, not the other way around,” and that the failure to recognize this is what leads to the above circularity (2008, pp. 139-140; see also Fodor’s debate with Piaget in Piattelli-Palmarini, 1980).

Fodor’s story about concept nativism in LOT 2 runs as follows: although no concepts—not even complex ones—are learned, concept acquisition nevertheless involves inductive generalizations. We acquire concepts as a result of experiencing their stereotypical instances, and learning a stereotype is an inductive process. Of course, if concepts were stereotypes then it would follow that concept acquisition would be an inductive process. But, Fodor says, concepts can’t be stereotypes since stereotypes violate compositionality (see above). Instead, Fodor suggests that learning a stereotype is a stage in the acquisition of a concept. His picture thus looks like this (2008, p. 151):

Initial state → (P1) → stereotype formation → (P2) → locking (= concept attainment).

Why think that P1 is an inductive process? Fodor says there are “well-known empirical results suggesting that even very young infants are able to recognize and respond to statistical regularities in their environments,” and “a genetically endowed capacity for statistical induction would make sense if stereotype formation is something that minds are frequently employed to do” (2008, p. 153). What makes this picture consistent with Fodor’s claim that “there can’t be any such thing as concept learning” (p. 139) is that he does not take P2 to be an inferential or intentional process (pp. 154-155). What kind of process is it? Here, Fodor doesn’t have much to say, other than it’s the “kind of thing that our sort of brain tissue just does”: “Psychology gets you from the initial state to P2; then neurology takes over and gets you the rest of the way to concept attainment” (p. 152). So, again, Fodor’s ultimate story about concept nativism is consistent with the view, as he puts it in Concepts, that “maybe there aren’t any innate ideas after all” (1998a, p. 143). Instead, there are innate mechanisms, which he now claims take us from the acquisition of stereotypes to the acquisition of concepts.

7. Modularity

In his influential book, The Modularity of Mind (1983), Fodor argues that the mind contains a number of highly specialized, “modular” systems, whose operations are largely independent from each other and from the “central” system devoted to reasoning, belief fixation, decision making, and the like. In that book, Fodor was particularly interested in defending a modular view of perception against the so-called “New Look” psychologists and philosophers (for example, Bruner, Kuhn, Goodman), who took cognition to be more or less continuous with perception. Whereas New Look theorists focused on evidence suggesting various top-down effects in perceptual processing (ways in which what people believe and expect can affect what they see), Fodor was impressed by evidence from the other direction suggesting that perceptual processes lack access to such “background” information. Perceptual illusions provide a nice illustration. In the famous Müller-Lyer illusion (Figure 1), for instance, the top line looks longer than the bottom line even though they’re identical in length.


Figure 1. The Müller-Lyer Illusion

Standard explanations of the illusion appeal to certain background assumptions the visual system is making, which effectively ‘override’ the fact that the retinal projections are identical in length. However, as Fodor pointed out, if knowing that the two lines are identical in length does not change the fact that one looks longer than the other, then clearly perceptual processes don’t have access to all of the information available to the perceiver. Thus, there must be limits on how much information is available to the visual system for use in perceptual inferences. In other words, vision must be in some interesting sense modular. The same goes for other sensory/input systems, and, on Fodor’s view, certain aspects of language processing.

Fodor spells out a number of characteristic features of modules. That knowledge of an illusion doesn’t make the illusion go away illustrates one of their central features, namely, that they are informationally encapsulated. Fodor says:

[T]he claim that input systems are informationally encapsulated is equivalent to the claim that the data that can bear on the confirmation of perceptual hypotheses includes, in the general case, considerably less that the organism may know. That is, the confirmation function for input systems does not have access to all the information that the organism internally represents. (1983, p. 69)

In addition, modules are supposed to be domain specific, in the sense that they’re restricted in the sorts of representations (such as visual, auditory, or linguistic) that can serve as their inputs (1983, pp. 47-52). They’re also mandatory. For instance, native English speakers cannot hear utterances of English as mere noise (“You all know what Swedish and Chinese sound like; what does English sound like?” 1983, p. 54), and people with normal vision and their eyes open cannot help but see the 3-D objects in front of them. In general, modules “approximate the condition so often ascribed to reflexes: they are automatically triggered by the stimuli that they apply to” (1983, pp. 54-55). Not only are modular processes domain-specific and out of our voluntary control, they’re also exceedingly fast. For instance, subjects can “shadow” speech (repeat what is heard when it’s heard) with a latency of about 250 milliseconds, and match a description to a picture with 96% accuracy when exposed for a mere 167 milliseconds (1983, pp. 61-64). In addition, modules have shallow outputs, in the sense that the information they carry is simple, or constrained in some way, which is required because otherwise the processing required to generate them couldn’t be encapsulated. As Fodor says, “if the visual system can deliver news about protons, then the likelihood that visual analysis is informationally encapsulated is negligible” (1983, p. 87). Fodor tentatively suggests that the visual system delivers as outputs “basic” perceptual categories (Rosch et al. 1976) such as dog or chair, although others take shallow outputs to be altogether non-conceptual (see Carruthers 2006, p. 4). In addition to these features, Fodor also suggests that modules are associated with fixed neural architecture (1983, pp. 98-99), exhibit characteristic and specific breakdown patterns (1983, pp. 99-100), and have an ontogeny that exhibits a characteristic pace and sequencing (1983, pp. 100-101).

On Fodor’s view, although sensory systems are modular, the “central” systems underlying belief fixation, planning, decision-making, and the like, are not. The latter exhibit none of the characteristic features associated with modules since they are domain-general, unencapsulated, under our voluntary control, slow, and not associated with fixed neural structures. Fodor draws attention, in particular, to two distinguishing features of central systems: they’re isotropic, in the sense that “in principle, any of one’s cognitive commitments (including, of course, the available experiential data) is relevant to the (dis)confirmation of any new belief” (2008, p. 115); and they’re Quinean, in the sense that they compute over the entirety of one’s belief system, as when one settles on the simplest, most conservative overall belief—as Fodor puts it, “the degree of confirmation assigned to any given hypothesis is sensitive to properties of the entire belief system” (1983, p. 107). Fodor’s picture of mental architecture is one in which there are a number of informationally encapsulated modules that process the outputs of transducer systems, and then generate representations that are integrated in a non-modular central system. The Fodorean mind is thus essentially a big general-purpose computer, with a number of domain-specific computers out near the edges that feed into it.

Fodor’s work on modularity has been criticized on a number of fronts. Empiricist philosophers and psychologists are typically quite happy with the claim that the central system is domain-general, but have criticized Fodor’s claim that input systems are modular (see Prinz 2006 for a recent overview of such criticisms). Fodor’s work has also been attacked from the other direction, by those who share his rationalist and nativist sympathies. Most notably, evolutionary psychologists reject Fodor’s claim that there must be a non-modular system responsible for integrating modular outputs, and argue instead that the mind is nothing but a collection of modular systems (see, Barkow, Cosmides, and Tooby (1992), Carruthers (2006), Pinker (1997), and Sperber (2002)). According to such “massive modularity” theorists, what Fodor calls the “central” system is in fact built up out of a number of domain-specific modules, for example, modules devoted to common-sense reasoning about physics, biology, psychology, and the detection of cheaters, to name a few prominent examples from the literature. Evolutionary psychologists also claim that these central modules are adaptations, that is, products of selection pressures that faced our hominid ancestors; see Pinker (1997) for an introduction to evolutionary psychology, and Carruthers (2006) for what is perhaps the most sophisticated defense of massive modularity to date.

That Fodor is a nativist might lead one to believe that he is sympathetic to applying adaptationist reasoning to the human mind. This would be a mistake. Fodor has long been skeptical of the idea that the mind is a product of natural selection, and in his book The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way (2001) he replies to a number of arguments purporting to show that it must be. For instance, evolutionary psychologists claim that the mind must be “reverse engineered”: in order to figure out how it works, we must know what its function is; and in order to know what its function is we must know what it was selected for. Fodor rejects this latter inference, and claims that natural selection is not required in order to underwrite claims about the teleology of the mind. For the notion of function relevant for psychology might be synchronic, not diachronic: “You might think, after all, that what matters in understanding the mind is what ours do now, not what our ancestors’ did some millions of years ago” (1998b, p. 209). Indeed, in general, one does not need to know about the evolutionary history of a system in order to make inferences about its function:

[O]ne can often make a pretty shrewd guess what an organ is for on the basis of entirely synchronic considerations. One might thus guess that hands are for grasping, eyes for seeing, or even that minds are for thinking, without knowing or caring much about their history of selection. Compare Pinker (1997, p. 38): “psychologists have to look outside psychology if they want to explain what the parts of the mind are for.” Is this true? Harvey didn’t have to look outside physiology to explain what the heart is for. It is, in particular, morally certain that Harvey never read Darwin. Likewise, the phylogeny of bird flight is still a live issue in evolutionary theory. But, I suppose, the first guy to figure out what birds use their wings for lived in a cave. (2000, p. 86)

Fodor’s point is that even if one grants that natural selection underwrites teleological claims about the mind, it doesn’t follow that in order to understand a psychological mechanism one must understand the selection pressures that led to it.

Evolutionary psychologists also argue that the adaptive complexity of the human mind requires that one treat it as a collection of adaptations. For natural selection is the only known explanation for adaptive complexity in the living world. Fodor replies that the complexity of the mind is irrelevant when it comes to determining whether it’s a product of natural selection:

[W]hat matters to the plausibility that the architecture of our minds is an adaptation is how much genotypic alternation would have been required for it to evolve from the mind of the nearest ancestral ape whose cognitive architecture was different from ours. … [I]t’s entirely possible that quite small neurological reorganizations could have effected wild psychological discontinuities between our minds and the ancestral ape’s. (2000, pp. 87-88)

Given that we don’t currently know whether small neurological changes in the brains of our ancestors led to large changes in their cognitive capacities, Fodor says, the appeal to adaptive complexity does not warrant the claim that our minds are the product of natural selection. In his latest book co-authored with Massimo Piattelli-Palmarini, What Darwin Got Wrong (2010), Fodor argues that selectional explanations in general are both decreasingly of interest in biology and, on further reflection, actually incoherent. Perhaps needless to say, this view has occasioned considerable controversy; for examples see Sober (forthcoming), Block and Kitcher (2010), and Godfrey-Smith (2010).

In The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way (2000), and also in LOT 2 (2008), Fodor reiterates and defends his claim that the central systems are non-modular, and connects this view to general doubts about the adequacy of RTM as a comprehensive theory of the human mind. One of the main jobs of the central system is the fixation of belief via abductive inferences, and Fodor argues that the fact that such inferences are isotropic and Quinean shows they cannot be realized in a modular system. These features render belief fixation a “holistic”, “global”, and “context-dependent” affair, which implies that it is not realized in a modular, informationally-encapsulated system. Moreover, given RTM’s commitment to the claim that computational processes are sensitive only to local properties of mental representations, these holistic features of central cognition would appear to fall outside of RTM’s scope (2000, chs. 2-3; 2008, ch. 4).

Consider, for instance, the simplicity of a belief. As Fodor says: “The thought that there will be no wind tomorrow significantly complicates your arrangements if you had intended to sail to Chicago, but not if your plan was to fly, drive, or walk there” (2000, p. 26). Whether or not a belief complicates a plan thus depends upon the beliefs involved in the plan—that is, the simplicity of a belief is one of its global, context-dependent properties. However, the syntactic properties of representations are local, in the sense that they supervene on their intrinsic, context-independent properties. To the extent that cognition involves global properties of representations, then, Fodor concludes that RTM cannot provide a model of how cognition works:

[A] cognitive science that provides some insight into the part of the mind that isn’t modular may well have to be different, root and branch, from the kind of syntactical account that Turing’s insights inspired. It is, to return to Chomsky’s way of talking, a mystery, not just a problem, how mental processes could be simultaneously feasible and abductive and mechanical. Indeed, I think that, as things now stand, this and consciousness look to be the ultimate mysteries about the mind. (2000, p. 99).

Thus, although Fodor has long championed RTM as the best theory of cognition available, he thinks that its application is limited to those portions of the mind that are modular. Needless to say, many disagree with Fodor’s assessment of the limits of RTM (see Carruthers (2003, 2006), Ludwig and Schneider (2008), and Pinker (2005)).

8. References and Further Reading

  • Arjo, Dennis (1996) “Sticking Up for Oedipus: Fodor on Intentional Generalizations and Broad Content,” Mind & Language 11: 231-235.
  • Aydede, Murat (1998) “Fodor on Concepts and Frege Puzzles,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 79: 289-294.
  • Aydede, Murat & Philip Robbins (2001) “Are Frege Cases Exceptions to Intentional Generalizations?” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 31: 1-22.
  • Barkow, Jerome, Cosmides, Leda, and Tooby, John (Eds.) The Adapted Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Block, Ned (1993). “Holism, Hyper-Analyticity, and Hyper-Compositionality,” Philosophical Issues 3: 37-72.
  • Block, Ned and Philip Kitcher (2010) “Misunderstanding Darwin: Natural Selection’s Secular Critics Get it Wrong,” Boston Review (March/April).
  • Boghossian, Paul (1993). “Does Inferential Role Semantics Rest on a Mistake?” Philosophical Issues 3: 73-88.
  • Brook, Andrew and Robert Stainton (1997) “Fodor’s New Theory of Content and Computation,” Mind & Language 12: 459-474.
  • Carruthers, Peter (2003) “On Fodor’s Problem,” Mind & Language 18: 502-523.
  • Carruthers, Peter (2006) The Architecture of the Mind: Massive Modularity and the Flexibility of Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Chomsky, Noam (1959) “A Review of B.F. Skinner’s Verbal Behavior,” Language 35: 26-58.
  • Evans, Gareth (1982) Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Janet, Jerry Fodor, and Merril Garrett (1975) “The Psychological Unreality of Semantic Representations,” Linguistic Inquiry 4: 515-531.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1970) “Three Reasons for Not Deriving “Kill” from “Cause to Die”,” Linguistic Inquiry 1: 429-438.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1974) “Special Sciences (Or: The Disunity of Science as a Working Hypothesis)” Synthese 28:97-115.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1975) The Language of Thought. New York: Crowell.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1980) “Methodological Solipsism Considered as a Research Strategy in Cognitive Psychology,” Behavioral and Brain Sciences 3: 63-109. Reprinted in Fodor (1981a).
  • Fodor, Jerry (1981a) RePresentations: Philosophical Essays on the Foundations of Cognitive Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press
  • Fodor, Jerry (1981b) “The Present Status of the Innateness Controversy,” In Fodor (1981a).
  • Fodor, Jerry (1983) The Modularity of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1986) “Why Paramecia Don’t Have Mental Representations,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 10: 3-23.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1987) Psychosemantics: The Problem of Meaning in the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1989) “Making mind matter more,” Philosophical Topics 67: 59-79.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1990) A Theory of Content and Other Essays. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1994) The Elm and the Expert: Mentalese and Its Semantics. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1998a) Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (1998b) In Critical Condition: Polemical Essays on Cognitive Science and the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (2000) The Mind Doesn’t Work That Way: The Scope and Limits of Computational Psychology. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (2003) Hume Variations. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry (2004) “Having Concepts: A Brief Refutation of the 20th Century,” Mind & Language 19: 29-47.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Charles Chihara (1965) “Operationalism and Ordinary Language,” American Philosophical Quarterly 2: 281-295.
  • Fodor, Jerry, Thomas Bever, and Merrill Garrett (1974) The Psychology of Language: An Introduction to Psycholinguistics and Generative Grammar. New York: McGraw Hill.
  • Fodor, Jerry, Merril Garrett, Edward Walker, and Cornelia Parkes (1980) “Against Definitions,” Reprinted in Margolis and Laurence (1999).
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Zenon Pylyshyn (1988) “Connectionism and Cognitive Architecture: A Critical Analysis,” Cognition 28: 3-71.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Ernest Lepore (1992) Holism: A Shopper’s Guide. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Ernest Lepore (2002) The Compositionality Papers. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Massimo Piattelli-Palmarini (2010) What Darwin Got Wrong. Farrar, Straus and Giroux.
  • Godfrey-Smith, Peter (2010) “It Got Eaten,” London Review of Books, 32 (13): 29-30.
  • Hale, Kenneth, and Samuel Jay Keyser (1993) “On Argument Structure and Lexical Expression of Syntactic Relations,” in K. Hale and S.J. Keyser (Eds.) The View From Building 20. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Hale, Kenneth, & Samuel Jay Keyser (1999) “A Response to Fodor and Lepore “Impossible Words?”” Linguistic Inquiry 30: 453–466.
  • Heil, John (2003). From An Ontological Point of View. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Horgan, Terrence (1998). “Recognitional Concepts and the Compositionality of Concept Possession,” Philosophical Issues 9: 27-33.
  • Jackendoff, R. (1983). Semantics and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Jackendoff, R. (1992). Languages of the Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Kim, Jaegwon (1993) Supervenience and Mind. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Loewer, Barry, and Georges Rey (Eds.) (1991). Meaning in Mind: Fodor and His Critics. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Lowe, E.J. (2008) Personal Agency: The Metaphysics of Mind and Action. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ludwig, Kirk, and Susan Schneider (2008) “Fodor’s Challenge to the Classical Computational Theory of Mind,” Mind & Language, 23, 123-143.
  • Melnyk, Andrew (2003) A Physicalist Manifesto: Thoroughly Modern Materialism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Miller, George, and Johnson-Laird, Philip (1976). Language and Perception. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Peacocke, Christopher (1992) A Study of Concepts. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Piattelli-Palmarini, Massimo (1980) Language and Learning. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Pinker, Steven (1989) Learnability and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Pinker, Steven (1997) How the Mind Works. New York: W. W. Norton & Company.
  • Pinker, Steven (2005) “So How Does the Mind Work?” Mind & Language 20: 1-24.
  • Prinz, Jesse (2002) Furnishing the Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Prinz, Jesse (2006) “Is the Mind Really Modular?” In Stainton (Ed.) Contemporary Debates in Cognitive Science. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Pustejovsky, James (1995) The Generative Lexicon. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Pustejovsky, J.(1998) “Generativity and Explanation in Semantics: A Reply to Fodor and Lepore” Linguistic Inquiry 29: 289-311.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1963) “Brains and Behavior”, reprinted in Putnam 1975b, pp. 325–341.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1967) “The Nature of Mental States”, reprinted in Putnam 1975b, 429–440.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1975) “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’,” Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science 7: 131-193.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1975b) Mind, Language, and Reality, vol. 2. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Pylyshyn, Zenon (2003). Seeing and Visualizing. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Quine, W.V. (1960) Word and Object. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Recanati, François (2002) “The Fodorian Fallacy,” Analysis 62: 285-289.
  • Rey, Georges (1993) “Idealized Conceptual Roles,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 53: 47-52.
  • Rey, Georges (2005) “Philosophical analysis as cognitive psychology,” In H. Cohen and C. Lefebvre (Eds.) Handbook of Categorization in Cognitive Science. Dordrecht: Elsevier.
  • Rives, Bradley (2009) “Concept Cartesianism, Concept Pragmatism, and Frege Cases,” Philosophical Studies 144: 211-238.
  • Rosch, Eleanor and Carolyn Mervis (1975) “Family Resemblances: Studies in the Internal Structure of Categories,” Cognitive Psychology 7: 573-605.
  • Rosch, Eleanor., Mervis, C., Gray, W., Johnson, D., and Boyes-Braem, P. (1976). “Basic Objects in Natural Categories,” Cognitive Psychology 8: 382–439.
  • Schneider, Susan (2005) “Direct Reference, Psychological Explanation, and Frege Cases,” Mind & Language 20: 423-447.
  • Segal, Gabriel (1997) “Content and Computation: Chasing the Arrows,” Mind & Language 12: 490-501.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney (2003) “Some Varieties of Functionalism,” In Shoemaker, Identity, Cause, and Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Shoemaker, Sydney (2007) Physical Realization. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sober, Eliot (forthcoming) “Selection-for: What Fodor and Piattelli-Palmarini Got Wrong,” Philosophy of Science.
  • Sperber, Daniel (2002) “In defense of massive modularity,” In Dupoux (Ed.) Language, Brain, and Cognitive Development. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Williamson, Timothy (2007). The Philosophy of Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.

Author Information

Bradley Rives
Indiana University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

The Trinity

Christians believe that God is a Trinity of Persons, each omnipotent, omniscient and wholly benevolent, co-equal and fully divine. There are not three gods, however, but one God in three Persons: Father, Son and Holy Spirit. Prima facie, the doctrine more commonly known as the Trinity seems gratuitous: why multiply divine beings beyond necessity—especially since one God is hard enough to believe in? For Christians, however, the Trinity doctrine is neither gratuitous nor unmotivated. Claims about Christ’s divinity are difficult to reconcile with the Christian doctrine that there is just one God: Trinitarian theology is an attempt to square the Christian conviction that Jesus is the Son of God, fully divine yet distinct from his Father, with the Christian commitment to monotheism. Nevertheless, while the Trinity doctrine purports to solve a range of theological puzzles it poses a number of intriguing logical difficulties akin to those suggested by the identity of spatio-temporal objects through time and across worlds, puzzle cases of personal identity, and problems of identity and constitution. Philosophical discussions of the Trinity have suggested solutions to the Trinity puzzle comparable to solutions proposed to these classic identity puzzles. When it comes to the Trinity puzzle, however, one must determine whether such solutions accord with theological constraints.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Motivation
    1. Why Should One Believe It?
    2. God and World: The Great Chain of Being and the Bright Line
    3. Trinity East and West: Loose and Descending or Tight and Flat?
    4. The Industry Standard: Nicea and Beyond
  2. Theological Constraints
    1. Monotheism
    2. The Distinctness of Persons
    3. The Equality of Persons, the Descending Trinity and the Filioque Clause
    4. Personality
    5. Christology and the Jesus Predicate Problem
  3. Philosophical Puzzles and Solutions
    1. Trinity and Identity
    2. The "Is" of Predication
    3. Divine Stuff: 'God' as a Mass Term
    4. Relative Identity
    5. The Trinity and Other Identity Puzzles
  4. References and Further Reading

1. History and Motivation

a. Why Should One Believe It?

Why should one believe that God is a Trinity of Persons? Historically, most writers have held that even if the existence of God could be known by natural reason, his Trinitarian character could only be discovered through revelation.  Such revelations in the tradition of the Church can only be indirectly encountered through the explication and interpretation of Scripture. This was, for example, Aquinas’ view. However, other writers have suggested that even discounting revelation, reflection on the nature of God should lead us to recognize his Trinitarian character. For instance, Richard Swinburne argues that there is at least a plausibility argument for a Trinity of divine persons insofar as God’s perfectly loving nature drives the production of the Trinitarian Persons:

I believe that there is overriding reason for a first divine individual to bring about a second divine individual and with him to bring about a third divine individual…[L]ove is a supreme good. Love involves sharing, giving to the other what of one’s own is good for him and receiving from the other what of his is good for one; and love involves co-operating with another to benefit third parties. [Richard Swinburne, The Christian God, p. 177-178]

However, this is a minority view, as other contemporary writers reject a prioriarguments for the doctrine of the Trinity.  For example, Brian Leftow challenges it by asking why perfect love should stop at three rather than four or more.

If natural reason fails to provide a compelling reason to regard God as Trinitarian, an appeal to Scripture does not fare much better. There are few hints in the Bible of the Trinity doctrine, which developed later during the Patristic period. The Trinitarian formula figures in injunctions to baptize “in the name of the Father, Son and Holy Spirit” in Matthew 28:19, but both twofold and threefold patterns occur in the New Testament, and there is no mention of the Trinity as such. Rausch in The Trinitarian Controversy notes:

The binatarian formulas are found in Rom 8:11, 2 Cor. 4:14, Gal. 1:1, Eph. 1:20, 1 Tim. 1:2, 1 Pet. 1:21 and 2 John 1:13. The triadic schema is discovered in Matt. 28:19, 1 Cor. 6:11 and 12:4, Gal. 3:11-14, Heb. 10:29, and 1 Pet. 1:2. All these passages indicate that there is no fixity of wording. No doctrine of the Trinity in the Nicene sense is present in the New Testament. (William G. Rusch. The Trinitarian Controversy. Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1980. P. 2)

Despite this ambiguity, the Gospels do pose puzzles that motivate the development of Trinitarian doctrine. First, they represent Jesus as both the Son of Man, who prays to the Father, and as a divine being, identified in the Fourth Gospel with the Logos, who is “with God and is God,” [John 1:1] and who also announces that he and the Father are “one” [John 10:30]. Second, Scripture speaks of the Spirit who descended on Jesus’ disciples at Pentecost, and who also is conventionally identified with the Spirit that moved over the waters at Creation in Genesis. Arguably, we may regard the Trinity doctrine as an explanatory hypothesis, which purports to make sense of divinity claims concerning the Son and Holy Spirit without undermining the Judeo-Christian commitment to monotheism.

b. God and World: The Great Chain of Being and the Bright Line

The Trinity doctrine is also part of a larger theological project. In the early Christian Era of the Hebrew tradition, there was a plurality of divine, semi-divine and otherwise supernatural beings, which has to be reconciled with Hebraic monotheism. Some of these beings, such as Yahweh’s suite of Seraphim and Cherubim, are indigenous; others were absorbed from Hellenistic religious culture. In the interests of an orderly theological monotheism, these beings have to be defined in relation to God. Some were absorbed into the Godhead as aspects, powers or components of the one God, others were demoted to angelic or demonic status, and yet others were dismissed as the mere hypostatizations of theological façons de parler. The doctrine of the Trinity emerged as part of that theological tidying up process, which, from the Judeo-Christian side, was aimed at drawing a bright line between the one God and everything else.

If Jews and Christians (insofar as they were faithful to their Hebraic roots), were intent on separating out the one God from all other things visible and invisible, Greeks had no compunction about multiplying supernatural beings. Indeed, the Greek problem of “the one and the many” was one of filling the gap between a simple, impassible, atemporal, incorporeal, incorruptible deity and a world of matter, the passive recipient of form, which was temporal, corporeal, and corruptible.

The traditional response was to introduce one or more divine, semi-divine or otherwise supernatural beings to mediate between the One and the many. So Plato, in the Timaeus, speculated that the material world had been created by the Demiurge, a Second God. This strategy was elaborated upon during the late Hellenistic period in Gnostic systems, which introduced elaborate systems of “emanations” from the divine in a continuum, a Great Chain of Being that stretched from the most elevated of beings, through intermediaries, and to those who were sufficiently remote from full divinity to be involved with the world of matter. During the Hellenistic period, Christians and Jews engaged in philosophical theology, like Origen and Philo, adopted similar views since Philosophy was of the Greeks, and the philosophical lingua franca was Platonism.

In contrast, there was no reason to construct a Great Chain of Being within the Hebrew tradition. The writers of Hebrew Scripture did not have any compelling philosophical interests and did not look for mechanisms to explain how things came into being or operated: fiat was good enough. Perhaps more importantly, they did not view materiality as inherently imperfect or defective and so did not need to posit mediating beings to bridge an ontological gap between the divine and base matter, a feature of the Greek tradition. This tradition, though it continued to figure in popular piety, was officially repudiated by orthodox Christians. Yahweh, according to the Genesis accounts, created the world by fiat—no mechanism required—and saw that it was good.

For philosophical theologians in the grip of the problem of the One and the many, fiat would not do—and for Christian theologians, committed to monotheism, the doctrine of mediating divine or semi-divine beings posed special difficulties. As heirs to the Hebrew tradition, they recognized a fundamental ontological dividing line between a divine Creator and his creation and faced the problem of which side of the line the mediating being or beings occupied—exacerbated by the monotheistic assumption that there was only room for one Being on the side of the Creator.

c. Trinity East and West: Loose and Descending or Tight and Flat?

The Trinity Doctrine was an attempt to accommodate both partisans of the Bright Line and also partisans of the Great Chain of Being including Christians who identified Jesus with the Logos, a mediating divine being through which the material world was created. Jews wanted to absorb all divine beings into the one God in the interests of promoting monotheism; Greeks wanted mediating beings to bridge the ontological gap between the world of time and change, and the transcendent reality beyond. In identifying the Logos, incarnate in Christ, as the Second Person of the Trinity, Christians aimed to bridge the ontological gap with a mediating being who was himself incorporated into the Godhead, satisfying the metaphysical interests of both Greeks and Jews.

Elaborated over three centuries before reaching its mature form in the ecumenical councils of Nicea (325 AD) and Constantinople (381 AD), the doctrine of the Trinity represents an attempt to organize and make sense of the Christian conviction that God created the material world, sustained it and acted within history, most particularly through Christ and in his Church. On this account, God creates all things through the Logos and enters into the world in Christ. Jesus promises that he will not abandon his people but that after ascending to his Father will send the Holy Spirit to guide his Church. The Logos and Holy Spirit are not merely supernatural beings of an inferior order who do God’s business in the world: according to the Biblical tradition the material world is not an inferior realm to be handled by inferior mediating beings. Accordingly, Christians needed to hold that the Logos and Holy Spirit were fully divine. To preserve monotheism, however, there could not be divine beings other than God, so Christians were pressed to incorporate the Logos and Holy Spirit into the divine nature.

The tension between those two theological interests shaped the ongoing development of Trinitarian doctrine insofar as the goal of Christian orthodoxy was to make sense of the role of Christ as a mediating divine being—God with us, the Word made flesh through which all things were made—while maintaining the bright line between a transcendent, divine being and everything else in the interests of supporting monotheism. Painting with a broad brush, the former concern drove the development of Trinitarian doctrine that evolved into the Eastern tradition of Social Trinitarianism; the latter shaped the theology of Latin Trinitarianism that came to dominate the West.

Social Trinitarians, in the interests of explaining Christ’s mediating role, conceive of the Trinity as a divine society, each member of which is fully personal, each a center of consciousness, each involved in a loving relationship with the others. This view puts pressure on monotheism; however, advocates suggest that the cost is worth it in order to accommodate what they regard as compelling religious interests. Scripture represents Christ as communicating interpersonally with his Father, praying and being commended as the Son with whom his Father is well pleased. Social Trinitarians regard this sort of relationship as religiously important insofar as it models, in an ideal form, the relationship between God and us, and also between us and our fellows. In addition, the picture of the Trinity as a loving divine society makes sense of the notion of God as Love. For Social Trinitarians, in any case, the fundamental problem is one of making sense of the unity of Persons in one divine Being and this is, indeed, the project of the theologians credited with being the progenitors of Social Trinitarianism: the Cappadocian Fathers, Basil, Gregory of Nazianzus and Gregory of Nyssa.

Latin Trinitarians, by contrast, begin with the God’s unity as given and seek to explain how the Persons may be distinguished one from another. If Social Trinitarians understand the Trinity as a society of Persons, Latin Trinitarians represent the Trinity in toto as an individual and imagine the Persons generated in some manner by the relations among them. In this vein, St. Augustine suggests that the Trinity is analogous to the mind, its knowledge of itself and love of itself, which are distinct but inseparable (Augustine, On the Trinity). Nevertheless, while Latin Trinitarianism makes monotheism unproblematic, it poses difficulties concerning the apparently interpersonal communication between Jesus and his Father, and in addition raises questions about how the Persons, in particular the Holy Spirit, can be understood as personal.

Although Social Trinitarianism and Latin Trinitarianism fall within the scope of Nicene orthodoxy, it may be instructive to consider the difference in heterodox views that emerge in the East and West. When Social Trinitarianism goes bad it degrades into Subordinationism, a family of doctrines that assign an inferiority of being, status or role to the Son and Holy Spirit within the Trinity, which has its roots in the emanationist theologies that proliferated in the Hellenistic world. This view is classically represented in the theology of the heresiarch Arius, who held that the Son was a mere creature, albeit “the first-born of all creation.” Eastern theology tends towards a “loose,” descending Trinity, to tri-theism and subordinationism and so Arianism is the characteristic Eastern heresy.

Western theology, by contrast favors a “tight,” flat Trinity and in the first centuries of the Christian era tended toward ultra-high Christologies like Apollinarianism, the doctrine that, crudely, Jesus was a man in whom the Logos took the place normally occupied by a human rational soul, and Monophytism, according to which Christ had only one nature, and that divine. If the characteristic Trinitarian heresy in the East was Arianism, the characteristic Western heresies belong to a family of heterodox views generically known as Monarchianism, a term coined by Tertullian to designate tight-Trinity doctrines in virtue of their emphasis on the unity of God as the single and only ruler or source of Being, including most notably Modalism (a.k.a. Sabellianism), the doctrine that the Persons of the Trinity are merely “modes,” aspects or offices of the one God.

d. The Industry Standard: Nicea and Beyond

There is enough doctrinal space between Arianianism and Sabellianism to accommodate a range of theological accounts of the Trinity within the scope of Nicene orthodoxy. The Nicene formula declared that the Son was homoousios, “of the same substance” as the Father, which was elaborated by the Cappadocian Fathers in the dictum that the Persons of the Trinity were one ousia but three hypostases. This knocked out Arians on the one side and Sabellians on the other, but left room for a range of interpretations in between since “ousia” was, notoriously, ambiguous. Aristotle had used the term to designate both individuals, substances that are bearers of essences and properties, and the essential natures of individuals, the natural kinds in virtue of which they are substances in the first sense. So, individual human beings are substances in the first sense, and the human nature they share, the natural kind to which they belong, is a substance in the second sense.

The Nicene homoousios formula inherited the ambiguity. Understood in one way, the claim that the Persons of the Trinity were “homoousios” said that the Persons were the same individual, skating dangerously close to the Sabellian claim that they were “monoousios”—of one substance. Understood in the other way, it said merely that they were of the same kind, an interpretation compatible with tri-theism. The Cappadocians attempted to clarify and disambiguate the Nicene formula by employing the term “hypostasis,” used earlier by Origen, to capture the notion of individual identity rather than identity of kind. By itself, this did not solve the problem. First, apart from their revisionary theological usage, ousia and hypostasis were virtual synonyms: as a solution to the Trinity puzzle this formula was rather like saying that the Persons were one thing but different objects. Secondly, “one ousia” still failed to rule out tri-theism—indeed, in non-theological cases, one ousia, many hypostases is precisely what different individuals of the same species are. Homoousios, as intended, ruled out the doctrine that Father and Son were merely similar kinds of beings—homoiousios—but it did not rule out their being distinct individuals of the same kind.

The Cappadocian dictum, however, provided a framework for further discussion of the Trinity puzzle: the Trinitarian Persons were to be understood as being the same something but different something-elses and the substantive theological question was that of characterizing the ways in which they were bound together and individuated.

As to the latter question, Nicea opened the discussion of the “theology” of the Trinity, understood as the exploration of the relations amongst Persons—the “immanent Trinity” as distinct from the “economic Trinity,” that is the Trinity understood in terms of the distinct roles of the Persons in their worldly activities, in creation, redemption and sanctification. Nicea cashed out the homoousios claim by noting that the Son was “begotten, not made” indicating that he was, as noted in a parallel formula then current, “out of the Father’s ousia.” Furthermore, the Holy Spirit was declared at Constantinople to have the same sort of ontological status as the Son. So in the Fourth Century, at the Councils of Nicea and Constantinople, and through the work of the Cappadocians, the agenda for Trinitarian theology was set and the boundaries of orthodoxy were marked.

Within these parameters, the Trinity doctrine poses problems of three sorts: first, theological problems in reconciling theological doctrines concerning the character and properties of God with Trinitarian claims; secondly, theological puzzles that arise from Christological claims in particular; and finally logical puzzles posed by the Trinity doctrine itself. It remains to be seen whether it is possible to formulate a coherent doctrine of the Trinity within the constraints of Christian orthodoxy.

2. Theological Constraints

a. Monotheism

Christians claim to be monotheists and yet, given the doctrine of the Trinity, hold that there are three beings who are fully divine, viz. God the Father, Son and Holy Spirit. The first Trinity puzzle is that of explaining how we can attribute full divinity to the Persons of the Trinity without either compromising monotheism or undermining claims about the distinctness of Trinitarian persons.

Orthodox accounts of the Trinity hover uneasily between Sabellianism—which construes Trinitarian Persons as mere phases, aspects or offices of one God—and tri-theism, according to which the Persons are three Gods. Tri-theism is unacceptable since it is incompatible with the historical Christian commitment to monotheism inherited from the Hebrew tradition.

The fundamental problem for Trinitarian orthodoxy is to develop a doctrine of the Trinity that fits in the space between Sabellianism (or other versions of Monarchianism) and tri-theism. For Social Trinitarians in particular the problem has been one of articulating an account of the Trinity that affirms the individuality of the Persons and their relationships with one another without lapsing into tri-theism.

b. The Distinctness of Persons

Historically, Monarchianism—in particular Modalism (or Sabellianism), the doctrine that the Persons are “modes,” aspects, or roles of God—has been more tempting to Christians than tri-theism. The fundamental problem orthodox Latin Trinitarians face is that of maintaining a distinction between Trinitarian Persons sufficient to avoid Sabellianism, since orthodox Christians hold that the Persons of the Trinity are not merely aspects of God or God under different descriptions but in some sense distinct individuals such that Father ≠ Son ≠ Holy Spirit.

Christians hold that there are properties that distinguish the Persons. First, there are intra–Trinitarian relational properties the Persons have in virtue of their relations to other Trinitarian Persons: the Father begets the Son, but the Son does not beget the Son; the Spirit proceeds from the Father (and the Son) but neither the Father nor the Son proceeds from the Father (and the Son). Secondly, the Persons of the Trinity are distinguished in virtue of their distinctive “missions”—their activities in the world. The Second Person of the Trinity becomes incarnate, is born, suffers, dies, is buried, rises from the dead and ascends to the Father. According to orthodox doctrine, however, the same is not true of the Father (or Holy Spirit) and, indeed, the doctrine that the Father became incarnate, suffered and died is the heresy of patripassionism.

According to Latin Trinitarians, God, the Trinity, is an individual rather than a community of individuals sharing the same divine nature and each Person of the Trinity is that individual. Given this account however, the trick is to block inferences from the ascription of properties characteristic of one Trinitarian Person to the ascription of those properties to other Persons. Moreover, since it is held that the Persons cannot be individuated by their worldly activities, Latin Trinitarians, whose project is to explain the distinctions between Persons, must develop an account of the intra–Trinitarian relations that distinguish them—a project which is at best speculative.

c. The Equality of Persons, the Descending Trinity and the Filioque Clause

Supposing that we tread the fine line, and succeed in affirming both the participation of Trinitarian Persons in one God and their distinctness. Orthodoxy then requires, in addition, that we hold the Persons of the Trinity to be equal in power, knowledge, goodness and all properties pertaining to divinity other than those that are specific to the Persons individually. This poses problems when it comes to divine agency. Assuming that doing A and doing A* are equally good, it is logically possible that one Person may prefer A while another prefers A* (and that the third is, perhaps, indifferent). In the absence of a tie-breaker, it is hard to see how the Trinity can get anything done! If the Person who prefers A and the Person who prefers A* stick to their guns, neither can accomplish his end so it would seem, neither can count as omnipotent; if they defer to one another they also end up in a deadlock.

This is a difficulty for Social Trinitarians in particular insofar as they understand the Trinitarian Persons as distinct centers of consciousness and will whose projects might be incompatible. Swinburne, a Social Trinitarian, attempts to avoid this difficulty by suggesting that the Father, in virtue of his character as the Source of Trinitarian Persons, has the authority to “lay down the rules” so that irresolvable conflicts amongst Trinitarian Persons will be avoided (Swinburne, pp. 172-173). If however we assume that the preferences of one Trinitarian person take precedence so that the other Persons willingly defer to him as a matter of policy, then it is hard to avoid the suspicion that some Persons of the Trinity are “more equal than others”—the heresy of Subordinationism.

Even if Social Trinitarians avoid Subordinationism, the descending account of the Trinity according to which the defining characteristic of the Father is that of being the Source of Trinitarian Persons has theological ramifications which, in the end, resulted in the defining controversy between Eastern and Western churches concerning the Filioque clause. The original version of the Creed formulated by the councils of Nicea and Constantinople, declares that the Holy Spirit proceeds from the Father (ek tou Patros ek poreuomenon). The Filioque Clause, affirming that the Holy Spirit proceeds from the Father and the Son (ex Patri Filioque procedit), which first appeared in the profession of faith formulated at the Council of Toledo in 589, spread throughout Gaul and eventually become normative in the West, was firmly rejected by the Eastern churches on the grounds that it undermined the doctrine that the Father was the Source of Trinitarian Persons and the personality of the Holy Spirit.

Photios, the 9th Century Patriarch of Constantinople who initiated the Photian Schism between East and West, argues in The Mystogogy of the Holy Spirit that the procession of the Holy Spirit from the Son as well as the Father implies that the Father is not up to the task of generating Trinitarian Persons. Either the Father can do the job on his own or he can’t. If he can, then the participation of the Son in the generation of the Holy Spirit is superfluous and so there is no reason to accept the Filioque Clause. If he can’t, then he is a theological failure, which is absurd. Photios, representing the Eastern tradition, assumes a descending account of the Trinity according to which the characteristic hypostatic property of the Father is his role as the Source of the other Trinitarian Persons. He assumes in addition that all properties of Trinitarian Persons are such that they are either generic properties of divinity, and so are shared by all Persons, or hypostatic properties possessed uniquely by the Persons they characterize. It follows from these assumptions that the Filioque Clause should be rejected.

Photios and other Eastern theologians worried also that the Western account of the Trinity undermined the personal character of the Holy Spirit. According to one metaphor, widely employed in the West, the Father, Son and Holy Spirit are analogous to the Lover, the Beloved and the Love between them. Love is not the sort of thing that can have psychological properties or count as a person and so Eastern theologians charged that the “flat” Trinitarian picture that dominated Western Trinitarian theology, in which the Holy Spirit was understood as a relation or mediator between Father and Son undermined the personhood of the Holy Spirit.

Is the “descending” picture at the heart of Eastern Trinitarian theology, according to which the Father is characteristically the progenitor of Trinitarian Persons, inherently subordinationist? It does not seem to be so since there is no compelling reason why we should regard the property of being the Source of Trinitarian persons as one that confers superior status or authority on its possessor. Some parents are smarter, better looking, and richer than their children; others are dumber, uglier, and poorer. When children are young their parents legitimately exercise authority over them; when they are grown up they become their parents’ peers. To the extent that the role of the Father as the Source of Trinitarian Persons is analogous to human parenthood there is no reason to regard the Father as in any respect superior to the other Persons and it is hard to see what other reason could be given for this view.

Nevertheless, the descending Trinity picture lends itself to subordinatist interpretations in a way that the flat Trinity model does not. So when, for example, Swinburne suggests that the Father’s essential character as Source of Trinitarian Persons confers on him the authority to resolve intra–Trinitarian disputes or entitles him to the deference of other Trinitarian Persons he is, at the very least, skating close to the edge of Subordinationism.

d. Personality

Finally, Christians hold that God is personal—the subject of psychological states. But what is personal: the Trinity in toto or the Persons individually? The Litany, which addresses the Persons individually, and the Trinity in toto suggests all of the above:

O God the Father, Creator of heaven and earth; Have mercy upon us.
O God the Son, Redeemer of the world; Have mercy upon us.
O God the Holy Ghost, Sanctifier of the faithful; Have mercy upon us.
O holy, blessed, and glorious Trinity, one God: Have mercy upon us.

But this does not seem to be a coherent position. If the Father, Son and Holy Spirit are distinct centers of consciousness, the sorts of beings to whom one can reasonably appeal for mercy, and the Trinity is a divine society as Social Trinitarians suggest, it would seem that the Trinity could not itself be personal in any robust sense. After invoking the Father, Son and Holy Ghost, the invocation of the Trinity seems superfluous—as if I were to ask permission to build a fence on our adjoining property lines from each of my neighbors and then get them together to ask permission of them as a group.

On the face of it Latin Trinitarians have an easier time explaining what is personal: it is God, the Trinity and the Persons are individually personal to the extent that each is God. The Father is God so insofar as God, the Trinity, is personal, the Father is personal; the Son and Holy Spirit are God so they too are personal. The invocations in the Litany are indeed redundant because all four invoke no one other than God, but that is just a matter of poetic license. Nevertheless, some Christians, in particular Eastern Christians who are sympathetic to the Social Trinitarianism, worry that some metaphors Latin Trinitarians exploit undermine the personal character of the Holy Spirit. In addition, Latin Trinitarianism makes Gospel accounts of Jesus’ praying to the Father difficult to make out. Who was praying to whom? On the Latin Trinitarian account it seems that, insofar as we identify Jesus with the Second Person of the Trinity, God was simply talking to himself.

e. Christology and the Jesus Predicate Problem

The doctrine of the Trinity, as noted earlier, is motivated by the Christian conviction that Jesus was, in some sense, divine. Jesus however was born, suffered under Pontius Pilate, was crucified, died and was buried; he did not understand Chinese; he believed that David was the author of all the Psalms. These properties are, it would seem, incompatible with divinity and, indeed, there appear to be a great many predicates that are true of Jesus which, it would seem, could not be true of God and vice versa.

This is the Jesus Predicate Problem: we do not want to ascribe all the predicates that are true of Jesus to God simpliciter or, in particular, to God the Father. We do not, for example, want to hold that the Father suffered on the Cross—the heresy of Patripassionism. God, as traditionally understood is impassible—he cannot be subject to suffering, pain or harm. Moreover God has no beginning in time or end, and is, according to most orthodox accounts atemporal insofar as he is eternal rather than merely everlasting: he exists outside of time in what is, from the perspective of his subjectivity, the eternal now. Jesus however was born at a particular time and lived his life in time, so to maintain God’s atemporality, we cannot allow predicates that assign temporal properties to Jesus to God, or in particular to God the Father. In general, there are a range of predicates that are true of Jesus that, we want to hold, are not true of God the Father or of the Holy Spirit, and which we would hesitate to ascribe to God simpliciter insofar as they appear to be inconsistent with essential features of divinity.

To avoid the migration of Jesus’ predicates to other Persons of the Trinity, we need to create enough logical space between the Persons to block inferences from claims about Jesus to claims about the Father so that, in general, “Jesus Fs” does not entail “God the Father Fs” where “x Fs” says either that x has a property, is a certain kind of thing or does a certain kind of action. The trouble with Monarchian accounts, which make the Trinity “too tight,” is that they obliterate the logical space between the Persons that would block such inferences. Since Monarchians cannot use Trinitarian doctrine to block these inferences they use Christology to do the job—by either adopting very high Christologies or very low ones.  The wedge has to be driven somewhere and, if there isn’t enough logical space to drive it in between the First and Second Persons of the Trinity, it has to go in between the Second Person, the divine Logos which is from the beginning with God and is God, and whatever it is that is the subject of Jesus predicates.

One way to do this is via an ultra-high Christology according to which the troublesome Jesus predicates aren’t literally true of Christ the divine Logos but are true of something else—the human body he animates, a mere appearance or an imposter. To see how this works, consider Apollarianism, an ultra-high Christology rejected at the Council of Constantinople in 381 and again at the Council of Chalcedon in 451 at which Christological doctrine was formulated. According to this heterodox view, the historical Jesus was a human being who had the Logos plugged into the place that would normally be occupied by a human rational soul. Christ is the Logos and, insofar we ascribe such Jesus predicates as “___ suffered under Pontius Pilate,” “___ was crucified,” “___ died” and “___ was buried” that is merely a façon de parler. Strictly speaking, what these predicates are true of is not Christ but only of the body he used for a time to conduct his worldly operations. Consequently, they do not pass to the Logos or to other Persons of the Trinity, so there is no problem.

The other way to drive the wedge between the Father and the bearer of Jesus predicates is by adopting an ultra-low Christology, that is, by kicking Christ out of the Godhead altogether. Historically, this is the tack taken by Adoptionists who held that the man Jesus became “Son of God” only by adoption and grace dispensed at by God at his baptism, and the view held by contemporary quasi-Christians who deny the divinity of Christ. If Christ, the bearer of Jesus predicates is not divine, problematic Jesus predicates do not pass to the Father, or to God simpliciter, so there is no problem.

Interestingly, Christians have historically rejected ultra-high Christologies on the grounds that they undermine soteriology. This concern was articulated by Gregory of Nazianzus in his critique of Apollinarianism by the dictum “non assumptus, non salus.” The idea is that God’s aim in becoming incarnate was to assume human nature in order to heal it—if Christ only seemed to be human that could not be accomplished. And if he only took on a human body and its vegetative and animal souls—the principles responsible for life, growth, locomotion and emotion—but not the rational soul of a human being, he would have left out the very component of humanness that was in need of healing, since it was precisely man’s rational nature that was corrupted by sin. Anselm makes the same point in Cur Deus Homo? Whatever we think of this sort of argument it was for this reason that Christians worried about Christologies that failed to recognize the full humanity of Christ.

Christians who could not accept either ultra-high or ultra-low Christologies attempted to circumvent the Jesus Predicate Problem by rejecting the ultra-tight Monarchian view of the Trinity. So, writing more than a century before Nicea, Hippolytus suggested that Hereclitean contradictions could be avoided by a Trinitarian doctrine that created enough logical space between the Persons to block inferences from the character of Christ, the Second Person of the Trinity, to claims about the character of the other Persons, the Father in particular. With sufficient logical space between the Persons, Christ’s vincibility, mortality and other properties that are prima facie incompatible with divinity or unworthy of a deity can be segregated so that they don’t transfer to the Father. Given a Subordinationist account on the descending model according to which the Second Person is a semi-divine mediating figure there is no problem assigning troublesome Jesus predicates to him.

The trouble is that once committed to the Nicene doctrine that Christ is wholly divine, consubstantial with and equal to the Father, “God of God, Light of Light, very God of very God,” the same problem arises all over again for the Second Person of the Trinity! If ascribing these properties to the Father is bad, ascribing them to the Son thus understood is just as bad. Historically, the Church’s way with Jesus predicate problems that threaten the doctrine of the Trinity has been to recharacterize them as Christological problems concerning the relation between Christ’s divine and human natures—which are beyond the scope of this essay.

We may ask however whether, once the Church’s Trinity theologians circumvent the Jesus Predicate Problem by passing the buck to the Christologists, there is any reason to worry about Modalism or other tight-Trinity doctrines that minimize the logical space between Persons. As we have seen, historically, the rationale for rejecting Sabellianism was the worry that it did not leave enough space to drive a wedge between Father and Son that would block inferences from “Jesus Fs” to “God the Father Fs.” If however we can contrive a theological account that blocks such inferences Christologically, by driving the wedge between the bearer of Jesus predicates and the Second Person of the Trinity—by, e.g. distinguishing between Christ’s divine and human natures or between Christ qua human and Christ qua God—then there is no particular reason to worry about the space between Trinitarian Persons, and so it may be that Sabellianism is a more attractive proposition than it was initially through to be.

3. Philosophical Puzzles and Solutions

For Christians, at least in the West, Quincunque Vult, commonly known as the Athanasian Creed, defines Trinitarian orthodoxy as follows:

We worship one God in Trinity, and Trinity in Unity, neither confounding the Persons, nor dividing the Substance
For there is one Person of the Father, another of the Son, and another of the Holy Ghost…
Such as the Father is, such is the Son, and such is the Holy Ghost…
[T]he Father is God, the Son is God, and the Holy Ghost is God.
And yet they are not three Gods, but one God

Christians are thus committed to the following claims:

(1) The Father is God

(2) The Son is God

(3) The Holy Spirit is God

(4) The Father is not the Son

(5) The Father is not the Holy Spirit

(6) The Son is not the Holy Spirit

(7) There is exactly one God

a. Trinity and Identity

Can one consistently believe (1) – (7)? It depends on how we read the “is” in (1) – (6). If we read it throughout as the “is” of strict identity, as “=” the answer is no. Identity is an equivalence relation: it is reflexive, symmetric and transitive, which is to say, for all x, y and z the following hold:

Reflexivity:           x = x

Symmetry:            If x = y then y = x

Transitivity:          If x = y and y = z then x = y

In addition, identity is an unrestricted indiscernibilty relation for all properties, which is to say it obeys Leibniz’ Law, understood as the Indiscernibility of Identicals:

LL:                         If x = y then for all properties, P, x has P if and only if y has P

This is bad news. Suppose we read the “is” as “=” in (1) – (6). Then it follows from (1) and (2), by symmetry and transitivity, that the Father is the Son, which contradicts (4). Put another way, given LL, (1) entails that God has all the same properties as the Father, including the property of being identical with the Father insofar as everything has the property of self-identity. (2) says that the Son likewise has all the same properties as God. It follows that, since God has the property of being identical with the Son, the Son also has the property of being identical with the Father, which contradicts (4).

These formal features of identity are non-negotiable in the way that the four-sidedness of squares is: God cannot evade them any more than he can make a square with only three sides. God can make triangles—and pentagons, chiliagons or figures with any number of sides he pleases—but he cannot make such things squares. So, assuming that “God,” “Father,” “Son” and “Holy Spirit” don’t change their reference, the “is” that figures in (1) – (6) cannot be the “is” of strict identity.

b. The "Is" of Predication

In English, most of the time the word “is” occurs it does not express an identity. The “is” that occurs in (8) and (9) is the “is” of predication: it is used to ascribe a property to an object:

(8) Ducati is a dog.

(9) Ducati is canine.

(8) is not an identity statement because “a dog” does not pick out a particular object. Identity is a relation between objects; in particular, it is the relation that everything bears to itself and to no other thing. In a true identity statement the nouns or noun phrases on either sides of the identity pick out the very same thing. (10) and (11) are true identity statements:

(10) Ducati is the chocolate Lab at 613 Second Avenue.

(11) Ducati is Britynic Cadbury of Bourneville

“The chocolate Lab at 613 Second Avenue” and “Britynic Cadbury of Bourneville” each pick out particular dog, as it happens, the same dog that “Ducati” picks out but “a dog” does not. (8) in fact says the same thing as (9)—it says that Ducati has the property of being a dog, that is the property of being canine. The “is” in (8), like the “is” in (9) is therefore, the “is” of predication.

Now consider (1) – (3) understanding the “is” that occurs in each sentence as the “is” of predication to yield:

(1') The Father is a God

(2') The Son is a God

(3') The Holy Spirit is a God

The “is” of predication does not express an equivalence relation and, in general, “x has P” and “y has P” do not imply “x is identical to y.” Ducati is a dog and Riley is a dog but it does not follow that Ducati is (identical to) Riley—in fact they are not. Similarly, (1') and (2') do not imply that the Father is the Son so there is no contradiction.

However, (1') – (3') just say that the Father, Son and Holy Spirit are each divine, in the way that (8) just says that Ducati is canine, and this leaves open the possibility that there are two, or three Gods involved. They do not explain what makes the Persons one God or provide any rationale for (7). Furthermore, together with (4) – (6) it seems to follow that there are indeed three Gods, just as it follows from “Ducati is a dog,” “Riley is a dog” and “Ducati is not Riley” that there are (at least) two dogs.

This is the concern Gregory of Nyssa addressed in his response to Ablabius, who worried that understanding the unity of Trinitarian persons in terms of their sharing the property of divinity implied Tri-theism:

The argument which you state is something like this: Peter, James, and John, being in one human nature, are called three men: and there is no absurdity in describing those who are united in nature, if they are more than one, by the plural number of the name derived from their nature. If, then, in the above case, custom admits this, and no one forbids us to speak of those who are two as two, or those who are more than two as three, how is it that in the case of our statements of the mysteries of the Faith, though confessing the Three Persons, and acknowledging no difference of nature between them, we are in some sense at variance with our confession, when we say that the Godhead of the Father and of the Son and of the Holy Ghost is one, and yet forbid men to say “there are three Gods”? The question is, as I said, very difficult to deal with. (Gregory of Nyssa, “To Ablabius”)

This is a difficult question indeed.

c. Divine Stuff: 'God' as a Mass Term

Gregory proposed the following analogy by way of a solution:

That which is not thus circumscribed is not enumerated, and that which is not enumerated cannot be contemplated in multitude. For we say that gold, even though it be cut into many figures, is one, and is so spoken of, but we speak of many coins or many staters, without finding any multiplication of the nature of gold by the number of staters; and for this reason we speak of gold, when it is contemplated in greater bulk, either in plate or in coin, as “much,” but we do not speak of it as “many golds” on account of the multitude of the material,-except when one says there are “many gold pieces” (Darics, for instance, or staters), in which case it is not the material, but the pieces of money to which the significance of number applies: indeed, properly, we should not call them “gold” but “golden.” As, then, the golden staters are many, but the gold is one, so too those who are exhibited to us severally in the nature of man, as Peter, James, and John, are many, yet the man in them is one. (Gregory of Nyssa. “To Ablabius”)

What Gregory has noticed here is that “gold” is a mass term rather than a count noun. Mass terms have a number of features that distinguish them from count nouns: in particular, they do not take plural, so to that extent as Gregory remarks, “gold…is one.” Intuitively, count nouns designate “things” while mass terms designate “stuffs”—gold, water, oatmeal and the like.

However, Gregory has inferred that human nature and, by analogy, divinity, should be understood as stuff too so that, just as there is one gold, parceled up into bits that are not properly speaking “gold” but merely golden there is just one man parceled up into bits each of which is not, properly speaking, man but merely human.

Richard Cartwright dismisses this solution very quickly as desperate, heretical and unhelpful:

It seems to have been left to Gregory of Nyssa, Basil's younger brother, to notice that, thus understood, consubstantiality of the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit appears to license saying that there are three Gods.  Gregory himself rather desperately suggested that strictly speaking there is only one man. But besides being itself heretical, the suggestion is of no help. (Richard Cartwright. “On the Logical Problem of the Trinity” in Richard Cartwright, Philosophical Essays. MIT Press, 1987. P. 171)

Nevertheless, it may be possible to push a little further along this line. Even though, intuitively, we think of mass nouns as designating more or less homogeneous stuffs, without perceptible, discrete but continuous parts, mass noun is a grammatical category and does not determine the character of what it designates but how we talk about it. The designata of some mass nouns have quite large, readily perceptible discrete parts. Consider “fruit” which, in English typically functions as a mass noun: the plural form, “fruits” is not ill-formed but it is rare and occurs primarily in idioms like “by their fruits ye shall know them”; we say “a lot of fruit” but only rarely “a few fruits” or “many fruits.” Perhaps most tellingly “fruit” takes what are called “sortalizing auxiliary nouns,” devices that attach to mass terms to yield noun phrases that behave like +count nouns: so we talk about “bodies of water,” “piles of sand” and, tellingly, “pieces of fruit.” From the grammatical point of view, Gregory’s revisionary proposal is in order: we can by an act of linguistic legislation decide to treat, perhaps for convenience, “human” as a mass term designating a spatially extended but gappy object, so that Peter, James and John are not, properly speaking, humans but rather pieces of humanity, a stuff which consists of Peter, James, John and all their fellows pooled together.

Perhaps the Trinity can be fixed by an account along the lines of Gregory’s proposal, according to which we may understand the God as a concrete but non-spatio-temporal whole, whose simple, non-spatio-temporal parts are the Trinitarian Persons. If so, then noting that parts need not be spatio-temporal, we might reconstruct (1) – (7) as follows:

(1'') The Father is a part of God

(2'') The Son is a part of God

(3'') The Holy Spirit is a part of God

(4'') The Father is not the same part of God as the Son

(5'') The Father is not the same part of God as the Holy Spirit

(6'') The Son is not the same part of God as the Holy Spirit

(7) There is exactly one God

(1'') – (7) are clearly consistent. Moreover if we remember that “God” is being treated as a mass term, designating all the divinity there is, in the way that “water” designates all the world’s water, of which lakes, rivers and puddles are parts, there is no difficulty in holding that the Persons are equally divine. Every body of water however small is thoroughly H2O: the humblest puddle is as watery as the Pacific Ocean and so, to that extent, water is wholly present in each of its parts. Similarly we can say that each Person is thoroughly God: divinity is wholly present in each of its (non-spatio-temporal) parts.

d. Relative Identity

Gregory’s proposal has not received widespread attention. However a comparable proposal, viz. that the “is” in (1) to (6) be construed as designating relative identity relations, has been widely discussed and solutions to the Trinity puzzle that make this move have been proposed by Peter Geach and more recently by Peter Van Inwagen.

According to Geach, identity statements of the form “x is identical with y” are incomplete: they are elliptical for “x is the same F as y” where F is a sortal term, that is a count noun that conveys criteria of identity. So common nouns like “table,” “man,” and “set” are sortals: grammatically they are count nouns and semantically they, in effect, provide instructions about how to identify them, how to chop out the hunk of the world they fill, how to distinguish them from other objects and how to trace their histories to determine when (if ever) they come into being and when (if ever) they cease to exist. Defenders of the relative identity thesis suggest that we cannot obey the instruction to “count all the things in this room” because “thing” does not convey identity criteria. If I am to count things, I need to know what sorts of things should I count? If I am asked whether this is the same as that, before I can answer I have to ask, “The same what?”

Geach notes further that, where F and G are sortals, it is possible to have cases where some x and y are the same F but not the same G. So, for example, we may want to say that 2/3 is the same rational number as 4/6 but not the same ordered pair of integers or that two copies of Ulysses are the same literary work but not the same book.

Finally, sortal-relative-identity relations are equivalence relations but they are not indiscernibility relations for all properties unrestrictedly. For any sortal-relative-identity relation, being-the-same-F-as, there is a set of predicates, SF, the indiscernibility set for F, such that for any predicate P Î SF, if x is the same F as y then x has P if and only if y has P. For predicates P* Ï SF the inferences from x is the same F as y and x has P* to y has P* and vice versa do not go through.

Now as regards the Trinity puzzle we note that “god” and “person” are sortals and hence that given Geach’s suggestion the following claims are consistent:

(1­R) The Father is the same god as God

(2R) The Son is the same god as God

(3R) The Holy Spirit is the same god as God

(4R) The Father is not the same divine person as the Son

(5R) The Father is not the same divine person as the Holy Spirit

(6R) The Son is not the same divine person as the Holy Spirit

The relative identity account of Trinitarian claims is similar to the reconstruction of Trinitarian claims in (1'') – (6'') insofar as rely on the strategy of invoking different relations in the first and last three statements: the relations of being-part-of-the-same-whole-as and being-the-same-part-as are different to one another as are the relations of being-the-same-god-as and being-the-same-divine-person-as. Consequently, (1R) – (6R) are consistent with (7). Sortals, as noted, provide rules for counting. Counting by book, two copies of Ulysses count as two; counting by literary work, they count as one. Similarly, the suggestion is that counting by divine person, the Father, Son and Holy Spirit count as three but counting by god they count as one and so we can affirm (7): there is exactly one God. The relative identity strategy thus avoids Tri-theism.

The relative identity strategy also circumvents the Jesus Predicate Problem, at least to the extent that we want to block inferences from “The Son Fs” to “The Father Fs” for a range of predicates including “became incarnate,” “was crucified,” “suffered under Pontius Pilate” and the like. To block objectionable inferences we note that these predicates do not fall within the indiscernibility set for divine person and so the relative identity strategy avoids Patripassionism.

In addition, on this account, we can explain why (1R) – (3R) entail that the Father, Son and Holy Spirit each have those properties that are constituitive of full divinity. We note that “is omnipotent,” “is omniscient,” “is omnibenevolent” and other generically divine properties are in the indiscernibillity set for god so that given God has the properties they designate we may infer that the same is true of the Father, Son and Holy Spirit. Intuitively, there are generically divine properties, designated by predicates in the indiscernibility set for for god, which all Trinitarian Persons have in virtue of (1R) – (3R) and there are hypostatic properties which each Person has in virtue of being the Person he is.

Relative identity is however a controversial doctrine in its own right and, even if we accept the metaphysical baggage it carries, may not suitable for theological purposes. So Michael Rae worries that relative identity commits one to a theologically disastrous antirealistism:

Many philosophers are attracted to antirealism, but accepting it as part of a solution to the problem of the Trinity is disastrous.  For clearly orthodoxy will not permit us to say that the very existence of Father, Son, and Holy Spirit is a theory-dependent matter.  Nor will it permit us to say that the distinctness of the divine Persons is somehow relative to our ways of thinking or theorizing. The latter appears to be a form of modalism. And yet it is hard to see how it could be otherwise if Geach’s theory of relative identity is true. For what else could it possibly mean to say that there is simply no fact about whether Father, Son, and Holy Spirit are the same thing as one another, the same thing as God, or, indeed, the same thing as Baal. (Michael Rae, “Relative Identity and the Doctrine of the Trinity,” Philosophia Christi vol. 5, No. 2)

e. The Trinity and Other Identity Puzzles

The logical problem of the Trinity arises because, as we have seen in 3.a, (1) – (7) are inconsistent if the “is” that figures in them is interpreted as the “is” of (absolute) identity. In this respect, the Trinity puzzle is comparable to a range of puzzles concerning the identity of ordinary material objects.

One range of such puzzles concerns the problem of material composition. A lump of clay is made into a statue. The statue and the lump occupy exactly the same spatial region so we want to say that they are they are the same thing and that there is just one material object in the region “they” occupy: we balk at the idea of more than one material object occupying exactly the same place. But the statue and the clay do not have all the same properties: the statue was formed by the sculptor but the lump was not; the lump can survive the most radical changes in shape, including changes that would transform it into a different statue but the statue cannot. Consequently we cannot hold that there is a statue and a lump of clay and that they are strictly identical without falling afoul of Leibniz’ Law. We want to say that the statue and clay count as one material object but we are barred from holding that they are strictly identical. In this respect the problem of material composition poses the same problem as the Trinity doctrine: we want to say the Persons are one God but we are barred, in this case by theological concerns, from saying that they are strictly identical.

The problem posed by the material composition and other identity puzzles, including the Ship of Theseus and the problem of the dividing self which figures in discussions of personal identity, is that there are a great many cases where we want to say that objects x and y are the same thing but where the relation between x and y is such that it violates the formal features of identity—either because it is one-many rather than one-one or because it is not an unrestricted indiscernibility relation. And this is precisely the problem posed by the doctrine of the Trinity.

It was noted above that the proposal in 3.b, that the “is” in (1) – (3) should be interpreted as the “is” of predication, is also unacceptable because it is tri-theistic. It was also noted that the accounts suggested in 3.c and 3.d are not overtly incoherent but ultimately depend respectively on whether a mereology and an account of relative are workable. The relative identity account has been discussed extensively in the literature. The worry about the relative identity account is not that it fails to produce the right results as regards the doctrine of the Trinity, but that relative identity is itself a questionable business and in any case carries metaphysical baggage that may be theologically unacceptable.

The moral of this story should perhaps be that “identity,” as Frege famously remarked, “gives rise to challenging questions which are not altogether easy to answer” (Gottlob Frege, “On Sense and Reference”). For all that critics have ridiculed the doctrine of the Trinity as a prime example of the absurdity of Christian doctrine—as the late Bishop Pike did when he suggested that the Trinity was “a sort of committee god”—Trinity talk is no worse off than much non-theological talk about the identities of non-divine persons and ordinary material objects.

4. References and Further Readings

  • Augustine. “On the Trinity.” The Early Church Fathers. Christian Classics Ethereal Library.
  • Baber, H. E. “Sabellianism Reconsidered.” in Sophia vol. 41, No. 2 (October 2002): 1-18.
  • Baber, H. E. “Trinity, Filioque and Semantic Ascent” forthcoming in Sophia.
  • Bobrinskoy, Boris. The Mystery of the Trinity. Crestwood, NY: St. Vladimir’s Seminary press, 1999.
  • Brower, Jeffrey E. and Michael C. Rea. “Material Constitution and the Trinity.” Faith and Philosophy 22 (2005): 57-76.
  • Brown, David. The Divine Trinity. London: Duckworth, 1985.
  • Cartwright, Richard. “On the Logical Problem of the Trinity.” In Philosophical Essays. The MIT Press, 1990.
  • Davis, Stephen T., Kendall, Daniel, S.J., and O’Collins, Gerald, S.J., eds. The Trinity. An Interdisciplinary Symposium on the Trinity. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Gregory of Nyssa. “To Ablabius.” The Early Church Fathers. Christian Classics Ethereal Library.
  • Hebblethwaite, Brian. Philosophical Theology and Christian Doctrine. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing Ltd, 2005. Esp. Ch. 5: “Trinity.”
  • Hippolytus, Against All Heresies, Book IX, The Early Church Fathers. Christian Classics Ethereal Library.
  • Leftow, Brian. “Anti Social Trinitarianism.” In The Trinity: An Interdisciplinary Symposium on the Trinity.  Feenstra, R. J. and Plantinga, C. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1989.
  • Peters, Ted. God as Trinity. Louisville, KY: Westminster/John Knox Press, 1993.
  • Photios, Patriarch of Constantinople. On the Mystagogy of the Holy Spirit. Astoria, NY: Studion Publishers, Inc., 1983.
  • Rea, Michael C. “Relative Identity and the Doctrine of the Trinity.” In Philosophic Christi vol. 5, No. 2 (2003): 431-445.
  • Rusch, William G., ed. The Trinitarian Controversy. Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1980.
  • Stead, C. Divine Substance. Oxford: The Clarendon Press, 1977.
  • Studer, Basil. Trinity and Incarnation. Collegeville, MN: The Liturgical Press, 1993.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Christian God. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1994.
  • Van Inwagen, Peter. “And yet there are not three Gods but one God.” In Philosophy and the Christian Faith, ed. T. V. Morris. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1988.
  • Yandell, K. E. “The most brutal and inexcusable error in counting?” Trinity and consistency.  Religious Studies 30 (1994): 201-17.

Author Information

H.E. Baber
University of San Diego
U. S. A.

Transmission and Transmission Failure in Epistemology

An argument transmits justification to its conclusion just in case, roughly, the conclusion is justified in virtue of the premises’ being justified.  An argument fails to transmit justification just in case, roughly, the conclusion is not justified in virtue of the premises’ being justified.  An argument might fail to transmit justification for a variety of uncontroversial reasons, such as the premise’s being unjustified; the premises’ failing to support the conclusion; or the argument’s exhibiting premise circularity.  There are transmission issues concerning testimony, but this article focuses on when arguments (fail to) transmit justification or knowledge or some other epistemic status.

Transmission failure is an interesting issue because it is difficult to identify what, if anything, prevents competent deductions from justifying their conclusions.  One makes a competent deduction when she accepts a deductive argument in certain circumstances.  These deductions seem to be the paradigmatic form of reasoning in that they apparently must transmit justification to their conclusions.  At the same time, though, certain competent deductions seem bad.  Consider Moore’s Proof:  I have a hand therefore there is at least one material thing.  Some philosophers hold that Moore’s Proof cannot transmit justification to its conclusion under any circumstances, and so, despite appearances, some competent deductions are instances of transmission failure.  Identifying what, if anything, prevents such arguments from justifying their conclusions is a tricky, controversial affair.

Transmission principles are intimately connected with closure principles.  An epistemic closure principle might say that, if one knows P and deduces Q from P, then one knows that Q.  Closure principles are silent as to what makes Q known, but the corresponding transmission principles are not.  A transmission principle might say that, if one knows P and deduces Q from P, then one knows Q in virtue of knowing P.

Those sympathetic to Moore’s Proof sometimes say that the “proof” can justify its conclusion even though it lacks the power to resolve doubt.  An argument can resolve doubt about its conclusion when the argument can justify its conclusion even for a subject who antecedently disbelieves or withholds judgment about the argument’s conclusion.

Table of Contents

  1. Transmission: The General Concept
  2. Transmission in Epistemology
  3. Transmission Failure
    1. Uncontroversial Causes
    2. Why Transmission Failure is an Interesting Issue
    3. Two More Puzzling Cases
  4. Transmission (Failure) vs. Closure (Failure)
    1. The Basic Difference
    2. The (Misplaced?) Focus on Closure
    3. Why Transmission is an Interesting Issue, Revisited
  5. Transmission Failure: Two Common Assumptions
    1. Transmission of Warrant vs. Transmission of Justification
    2. Transmission vs. Resolving Doubt
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Transmission: The General Concept

The term ‘transmission’ is not unique to philosophical discourse: religious and cultural traditions often are transmitted from one generation to the next; diseases from one person to another; and information of various kinds from one computer to another (often via the internet).  A car’s transmission gets its name from its intended purpose, namely to transmit the energy from the engine to its wheels (to put it crudely).  The use of ‘transmission’ in epistemological contexts is deeply connected to its use in everyday contexts.  Tucker (2010, section 1) holds that one can clarify the epistemological concept of transmission by considering an everyday instance of transmission.

Under what conditions does Alvin’s computer A transmit information to another computer B?  Tucker suggests it will do so just in case (i) A had the information and (ii) B has the information in virtue of A’s having it.  The first condition is very intuitive.  If A does not have the information but B acquires it anyway, it may be true that something transmitted the information to B.  Yet, unless A has the information, it won’t be true that A transmitted the information to B.  The second condition is intuitive but vague.  If B has the information in virtue of A’s having it, then A causes B to have it.  Yet mere causation is not enough to satisfy this in virtue of relation.  If A sends the information to B over an Ethernet or USB cable, we do seem to have the requisite sort of causal relation, and, in these cases, A seems to transmit the information to B.

Suppose A just finished downloading the information, which makes Alvin so excited that he does a wild victory dance.  During this dance he accidently hits B’s keyboard, which causes B to download the information from the internet (and not Alvin’s computer).  In such a case, A’s having the information causes B to have it, but the information was not transmitted from A to B.  Although transmission requires that a causal relation hold, not just any causal relation will do.  This article will follow Tucker in using ‘in virtue of’ as a placeholder for whatever causal relation is required for transmission.

Generalizing from this example, Tucker concludes that transmission is a three-place relation between: (i) the property P that is transmitted; (ii) the thing a from which the property is transmitted; and (iii) the thing b to which the property is transmitted.  A property P is transmitted from a to b just in case b has P in virtue of a’s having P.  In the above example, the property P is having the information; a is A, Alvin’s computer; and b is B, some other computer.  So A transmits the information to B just in case B has the information in virtue of A’s having it.

The preceding discussion clarifies statements of the form ‘a transmits P to b’, but there is another, more informative kind of transmission ascription, which we can symbolize as ‘R transmits P from a to b’.  Contrast ‘A transmitted the information to B’ with the equally natural expression ‘The USB cable transmitted the information from A to B’.  Whereas the former notes only that the information was transmitted from A to B, the latter additionally notes how it was transmitted.  Under what conditions does the USB cable (more precisely: being connected by the USB cable) transmit the information from A to B?  I suggest that it will do so just in case (i) A had the information and (ii) B has the information in virtue of both A’s having it and A’s being connected by a USB cable to B.

2. Transmission in Epistemology

When epistemologists consider transmission or transmission failure, they generally ask such questions as:

  • Under what conditions does entailment transmit justification?
  • Under what conditions do competent deductions transmit rational belief?
  • Does testimony transmit knowledge?

Epistemologists, then, are concerned with whether some relation (for example, entailment, competent deduction, testimony) transmits some epistemic property (for example, being rational, being justified, being known, or being defeated).  They tend to have in mind, therefore, the more informative sort of transmission ascription (see section 1).  That is, they are concerned not just with whether a belief is, say, known in virtue of another belief’s being known; they are also concerned with whether, say, entailment is the particular relation that allows the first belief to be known in virtue of the second.

This article will focus exclusively on when arguments or inferences (fail to) transmit some epistemic value property, such as being justified or being known.  The reason is that, when philosophers talk about transmission failure as an independent issue, they tend to have in mind the conditions under which an argument or inference fails to transmit.  The conditions under which testimony (fails to) transmit, say, knowledge is an interesting and important issue.  Yet these issues are often pursued in conjunction with or subsumed under other important issues relating to testimony, such as the conditions under which testimony preserves knowledge.  (For a brief intro to some of the relevant transmission issues pertaining to testimony, see Lackey 2008, section 3.)  In any case, this article will focus on the transmission issues pertaining to arguments or inferences, rather than the issues pertaining to testimony or other epistemically interesting relations.

An argument is a set of propositions such that one proposition, the conclusion, is supported by or is taken to be supported by the other propositions in that set, the premises.  An argument, as such, is merely a set of propositions that bear a special relation with one another.  Arguments can play a role in transmitting justification or knowledge when a subject believes the premises or when a subject infers the conclusion from the premises.  If epistemic transmission is analogous to the above computer transmission case (sec. 1), then an argument transmits justification to its conclusion when (i) the premises have some epistemically valuable status (for example, being justified, being known) and (ii) the conclusion has that same status in virtue of the premises’ having it.  (Here and elsewhere, for the sake of simplicity, I ignore the additional complexity of the more informative transmission ascriptions.)  The following case seems to satisfy (i) and (ii), and so it seems to transmit justification from the premises to the conclusion.

The Counting Case: Consider this argument: (a) that there are exactly 25 people in the room; and (b) that if there are exactly 25 people in the room, then there are fewer than 100 people in the room; therefore (c) there are fewer than 100 people in the room.  Suppose that Counter justifiably believes (a) on the basis of perception; that he justifiably believes (b) a priori; and that he believes (c) on the basis of (a) and (b).

The counting case seems to be a paradigmatic case of successful transmission.  Counter’s belief in the premises, namely (a) and (b), are justified (so (i) is satisfied), and the conclusion, namely (c), seems to be justified in virtue the premises’ being justified (so (ii) is satisfied).  Notice, however, that whether an argument transmits is relative to a subject.  The argument in the Counting Case transmits for Counter but not for someone who lacks justification for the premises.

The Counting Case also illustrates the deep connection between the transmission of justification and inferential justification.  When philosophers address inferential justification, they are concerned with the conditions under which the premises of an argument justify the argument’s conclusion. If one belief (belief in the premise) justifies another belief (belief in the conclusion), belief in the conclusion is inferentially justified.  Notice that the conclusion in the counting case is inferentially justified because it is justified by its premises.  The Counting Case, therefore, illustrates both inferential justification and the successful transmission of justification.  This is no accident.  It is almost universally assumed that inferential justification works by transmission; it is assumed that when the conclusion is justified by the premises, the premises transmit their justification to their conclusions.  Hence, the transmission of justification across an argument is deeply connected to inferential justification.

It should be noted that sometimes, when philosophers talk about transmission, they use the term “transfer” rather than “transmission” (for example, Davies 1998).  The latter terminology seems preferable, as Davies now admits (2000: 393, nt. 17).  “Transfer” often connotes that, when P is transferred from a to b, a no longer has P.  If I transfer water from one cup to another, the transferred water is no longer in the first cup.  “Transmission” lacks that connotation: when a computer transmits some information to another computer, the first computer typically retains the transmitted information.

3. Transmission Failure

a. Uncontroversial Causes

An argument is an instance of transmission failure just in case it does not transmit (some degree of) justification (or whatever epistemic status is at issue) from the premises to the conclusion.  Arguments can fail to transmit justification to their conclusions for a number of reasons.  Here are a few relatively uncontroversial causes of transmission failure:

  • Unjustified Premises: If an argument’s premises are all unjustified, then the argument is a trivial case of transmission failure; for the premises had no justification to transmit to its conclusion in the first place.  It does not follow, though, that all of an inference’s premises must be justified for it to transmit justification to its conclusion.  Consider an inductive inference with 100 premises of the form ‘on this occasion the unsuspended pencil fell to the ground’.  If 99 of the 100 premises are justified, it seems that those 100 premises can transmit justification to the belief that the next unsuspended pencil will also fall, despite that one of the premises fails to be justified.  (See the article “Deductive and Inductive Arguments” for a brief explanation of the differences between deductive and inductive arguments.)
  • Premise Circularity:  An argument is premise circular just in case its ultimate conclusion also appears as a premise.  For instance, consider P therefore Q therefore P.  The ultimate conclusion, P, is used as the sole premise for the intermediate conclusion, Q.  Even given that P transmits justification to Q, it seems clear that the justification P has in virtue of Q cannot be transmitted back to Q.  (The term ‘premise circular’ will be used loosely, such that both the extended argument P therefore Q therefore P and the second stage of the argument, Q therefore P, are premise circular.)
  • The Premises Fail to Evidentially Support Their Conclusion: Consider the argument: ‘I have a hand; therefore, the Stay Puft Marshmallow Man is eating a Ghostbuster’.  The premise is justified; however, it fails to transmit its justification to the conclusion because having a hand is not evidence that the Marshmallow Man is doing anything, much less eating a Ghostbuster.
  • The Premises Provide Less Than Maximal Evidential Support: An argument that provides maximal evidential support, such as one in the form of modus ponens, is capable of transmitting all of its premises’ justification to the conclusion.  Arguments that provide some less-than-maximal degree of support, such as a good inductive argument, fail to transmit all of the premises’ justification to the conclusion.  Good inductive arguments with justified premises both partially transmit and partially fail to transmit justification from the premises to the conclusion.  Other things being equal, the stronger the support, the more justification the argument transmits from the premises to the conclusion.
  • Defeaters: A good argument might fail to transmit justification because one has a relevant defeater (for example, relevant counterevidence).  Suppose I believe some mathematical theorem T on what is in fact exemplary deductive reasoning.  If I know that my coffee has been spiked with a drug known to cause egregious errors in reasoning, then my exemplary deductive reasoning is an instance of at least partial transmission failure.

b. Why Transmission Failure is an Interesting Issue

It is relatively uninteresting if an argument fails to transmit for any of the above reasons.  But suppose an argument has well-justified premises; the premises provide deductive (so maximal) support for their conclusion; the subject knows that the premises provide deductive support for their conclusions; there are no relevant defeaters; and it is not premise circular.  A person makes a competent deduction when they accept such an argument.  (Others use the term “competent deduction,” but they often mean something slightly different by the term, including Tucker (2010).)  One might think that competent deductions are the paradigm of good reasoning, that they must transmit justification to their conclusions.  Interest in transmission failure arises because, at first glance at least, there are such arguments that do seem to be instances of transmission failure.  Interest in transmission failure persists because it is very hard to identify what would cause such arguments to be instances of transmission failure.  Consider the following example.

Some philosophers, sometimes called “idealists,” hold that the only things that exist are minds and their ideas.  These idealists, therefore, are skeptics about material objects.  In other words, they reject that there are material objects, where material objects are non-mental objects composed of matter.  These philosophers tend to hold that there are ideas of hands but no hands.  There are ideas of chairs, even apparent perceptions of chairs, but there are no chairs.  Responding to these idealists, G. E. Moore declared that he could prove the existence of the external, or non-mental, world.  Here is his “proof”:

Moore’s Proof (MP)

(MP1)   I have a hand.

(If I have a hand, then there is at least one material object.)

(MP2)  There is at least one material object.

This argument is widely criticized and scorned.  Yet if it fails to transmit justification to its conclusion, why does it do so?

Well, Moore’s Proof is not an instance of transmission failure for any of the obvious reasons: it is a deductive argument; its premise seems well-justified on the basis of perceptual experience; there are no relevant defeaters; and it is not premise circular (that is, Moore did not—or at least need not—use MP2, the conclusion of Moore’s Proof, as a premise for his belief in MP1).  Still, it is hard to dispel the sense that this argument is bad.  This argument seems to beg the question against the skeptic, but it is unclear whether question-begging, by itself, can cause transmission failure (see sec. 5b).  Perhaps Moore’s Proof is not just question-begging, but also viciously circular in some way.  The problem is that it is hard to identify a type of circularity that both afflicts Moore’s argument and is clearly bad.

c. Two More Puzzling Cases

Moore’s Proof is a puzzling case.  If one accepts Moore’s Proof, she has made a competent deduction, which would seem to make it the paradigm of good reasoning.  Nonetheless, it still seems to be a bad argument.  The puzzling nature of this case also appears in a variety of other arguments, including the following two arguments.

Moore’s Proof is aimed at disproving idealism insofar as it is committed to skepticism about the material world, that is, the claim that the external world does not exist.  Consider, however, perceptual skepticism, the idea that, even if the external world does exist, our perceptual experiences do not give us knowledge (directly or via an inference) of this non-mental realm. Proponents of this skepticism typically concoct scenarios in which we would have exactly the same experiences that we do have, but where our perceptual experiences are wildly unreliable.  One popular scenario is that I am the unwitting victim of a mad scientist.  The mad scientist removed my brain, placed it in a vat of nutrients, and then hooked me up to his supercomputer.  In addition to keeping me alive, this supercomputer provides me with a computer generated reality, much like the virtual reality described by the movie Matrix.  Although all of my perceptual experiences are wildly unreliable, they seem just as genuine and trustworthy as my actual experiences.  The skeptic then reasons as follows: if you cannot tell whether you are merely a brain-in-a-vat in the above scenario, then you do not know you have a hand; you cannot tell whether you are a brain-in-a-vat (because your experiences would seem just as genuine even if you were a brain-in-a-vat); therefore, you do not know whether you have a hand.  (See Contemporary Skepticism, especially section 1, for further discussion of this type of skepticism.)

Some philosophers respond that the sort of reasoning in Moore’s Proof can be applied to rule out the skeptical hypothesis that we are brains-in-vats.  Hence:

The Neo-Moorean Argument

(NM1)    I have a hand.

(If I have a hand, then I am not a brain-in-a-vat.)

(NM2)    I am not a brain-in-a-vat.

The Neo-Moorean Argument is just as puzzling as Moore’s Proof.  If one accepts the Neo-Moorean Argument, she has accepted a competent deduction which seems to be the paradigm of good reasoning.  Yet the argument still seems bad, which is why some philosophers hold that it is an instance of transmission failure.

The Zebra Argument, like the Neo-Moorean Argument, is intended to rule out a certain kind of skeptical scenario.  Bobby is at the zoo and sees what appears to be zebra.  Quite naturally, he believes that the creature is a zebra on the basis of its looking like one.  His son, however, is not convinced and asks: “Dad, if a mule is disguised cleverly enough, it will look just like a real zebra.  So how do you know that the creature isn’t a cleverly disguised mule?”  Bobby answers his son’s question with:

The Zebra Argument

(Z1)        That creature is a zebra.

(If it is a zebra, then it is not a cleverly disguised mule.)

(Z2)        It is not a cleverly disguised mule.

It seems that to know that the creature is a zebra, one must know already in some sense that the creature is not a cleverly disguised mule.  Hence, Bobby’s argument seems to exhibit a suspicious type of circularity despite qualifying as a competent deduction.

(There is a rather wide variety of other puzzling cases.  For reasons that will be explained in the next section, arguments that allegedly violate closure principles are also potential examples of transmission failure.  Readers interested in semantic or content externalism should consider McKinsey’s Paradox in section 5 of the closure principles article.  Readers with expertise in the philosophy of mind might be interested in some examples raised by Davies (2003: secs. 3, 5).)

4. Transmission (Failure) vs. Closure (Failure)

Discussions of transmission and transmission failure are connected intimately with discussions of closure and closure failure, which raises the question of how these issues are related.

a. The Basic Difference

Closure principles say, roughly, that if one thing a has some property P and bears some relation R to another thing b, then b also will have P.  More succinctly (and ignoring universal quantification for simplicity’s sake), closure principles say that, if Pa and Rab, then Pb.  Suppose that the property being a pig is closed under the relation being the same species as.  Suppose, in other words, that if Albert is a pig, then anything that is the same species as Albert is also a pig.  Given this assumption, if Albert is a pig and Brutus is the same species as Albert, then Brutus is a pig.  Yet being a pig is clearly not closed under the relation being the same genus as.  Pigs are in the genus mammal along with humans, cows, poodles, and many other creatures.  If Albert is a pig and Brutus is in the same genus as Albert, it does not follow that Brutus is a pig.  Brutus could be a terribly ferocious poodle and still be in the same genus as Albert.

In epistemological contexts, the relevant P will be an epistemic property, such as being justified or known, and R will be something like being competently deduced from or being known to entail.  An epistemic closure principle might say: If Billy knows P and Billy competently deduces Q from P, then Billy also knows Q.

Transmission principles are stronger than their closure counterparts.  Transmission principles, in other words, say everything that their closure counterparts say and more besides.  Recall that closure principles hold that, if Pa and Rab, then Pb.   Transmission principles hold instead that, if Pa and Rab, then Pb in virtue of Pa. Closure principles merely say that b has the property P, but they do not specify why b has that property.  Transmission principles say not only that b has P, but also that b has P because, or in virtue of, Pa and Rab.

Notice that a closure principle can be true when the corresponding transmission principle is false.  Consider:

Pig Closure: If Albert is a pig and is the same species as Brutus, then Brutus is also a pig.

Pig Transmission: If Albert is a pig and is the same species as Brutus, then Brutus is a pig in virtue of Albert’s being a pig.

Even though we are assuming that Pig Closure is true, Pig Transmission will be false when Albert and Brutus are unrelated pigs.  Brutus’ being a pig might be explained by his parents being pigs and/or his having a certain DNA structure, but not by Albert’s being a pig.  Although closure principles can be true when their transmission counterparts are false, if a transmission principle is true, its closure counterpart must also be true.  This is because transmission principles say everything that their closure counterparts say (and more besides).

Epistemic closure principles likewise can be true when their transmission counterparts are false.

Simple Closure: If S knows that P and deduces Q from P, then S knows that Q.

Simple Transmission: If S knows that P and deduces Q from P, then S knows that Q in virtue of knowing that P.

Even supposing Simple Closure is true (which it probably is not), Simple Transmission is false.  Suppose S knows Q on the basis of perceptual experience and then comes to know P on the basis of her knowing Q.  It would be premise circular if she then also based her belief in Q on her belief in P.  If she did so, her extended argument would be Q therefore P therefore Q.  It is plausible in such a case that S still knows the conclusion Q on the basis of the relevant perceptual experience.  Assuming she still knows Q, her deduction from P to Q is not a counterexample to Simple Closure.  On the other hand, this case is a clear counterexample to Simple Transmission.  Although she knows Q, she knows it in virtue of the perceptual experience, not deducing it from her knowledge that P.

The difference between closure and transmission principles was just explained.  Next, the difference between closure and transmission failure will be explained.  There is an instance of closure failure when Pa and Rab hold, but Pb does not.  Simple Closure suffers from closure failure just in case someone deduces Q from her knowledge that P but nonetheless fails to know that Q.  An instance of simple closure failure just is a counterexample to Simple Closure.

There is an instance of transmission failure whenever it is false that Pb in virtue of Pa and Rab.  There are three types of transmission failure which correspond to the three ways in which it might be false that Pb holds in virtue of Pa and Rab.  The first type occurs just in case either Pa or Rab does not hold.  If Pa and Rab do not hold, then Pb cannot hold in virtue of Pa and Rab.  Consequently, Rab would fail to transmit P from a to b.  Notice that this first type of transmission failure can occur even if the relevant transmission principle is true.  Transmission principles do not say that Pa and Rab in fact hold; instead they say if Pa and Rab hold, then Pb holds in virtue of Pa and Rab.  If S fails to know P or fails to deduce Q from P, then the deduction fails to transmit knowledge from P to Q.  Nonetheless, Simple Transmission might still be true, because it does not demand that S actually deduce Q from her knowledge that P.  A similar point explains why one can have type-one transmission failure without having closure failure, that is, without having a counterexample to the corresponding closure principle.  There is, therefore, an interesting difference between transmission and closure failure: an instance of closure failure just is a counterexample to some relevant closure principle, but an instance of transmission failure need not be a counterexample to some relevant transmission principle.

Although the first type of transmission failure never provides a counterexample to some relevant transmission principle, the second and third types always provide such a counterexample. The second type occurs just in case Pa and Rab holds but Pb does not—precisely the same circumstances in which closure failure occurs.  In other words, the second type of transmission failure occurs just in case closure failure does.  It follows that all instances of closure failure are instances of transmission failure.  It does not follow, however, that all instances of transmission failure are instances of closure failure: there will be transmission failure without closure failure whenever there is transmission failure of the first or third types.  Simple Transmission suffers from type-two transmission failure (and closure failure) just in case S deduces Q from her knowledge that P but nonetheless fails to know Q.  (The idea that all instances of closure failure are instances of transmission failure but not vice versa also follows from the fact that transmission principles say everything that their closure counterparts say and more besides.  By saying everything that closure principles say, transmission principles will fail whenever their closure counterparts do.  By saying more than their closure counterparts, they sometimes will fail even when their closure counterparts do not.)

The third type of transmission failure occurs just in case Pa, Rab, and Pb hold, but Pb does not hold in virtue of Pa and Rab.  Since closure principles do not demand that Pb hold in virtue of Pa and Rab, a closure principle may be true even if its corresponding transmission principle suffers from type-three transmission failure.  Simple Transmission suffers from type-three transmission failure just in case S deduces Q from S’s knowledge that P, S knows Q, but S does not know Q in virtue of the deduction from her knowledge that P.  The premise circular argument discussed in this sub-section is a plausible example of this type of failure.  As was explained above, in such a case Simple Closure might hold but Simple Transmission would not.

b. The (Misplaced?) Focus on Closure

There is no doubt that, in the epistemological literature, closure failure is in some sense the bigger issue.  Some epistemological theories seem committed to rejecting intuitive closure principles, and there is extensive debate over how serious of a crime it is to reject these principles.  Although the literature on transmission failure is by no means scant, considerably more ink has been spilt over closure failure.  One naturally is inclined to infer that closure failure is the more important issue, but this may be incorrect: the literature’s focus on closure failure may be misplaced—though this potential misplacement is likely harmless.

Crispin Wright (1985: 438, nt. 1) was perhaps the first to distinguish between epistemic closure and transmission principles, but much of the literature has not observed this distinction, a fact that has been noted by Wright (2003: 76, nt.1) and Davies (2000: 394, nt. 19).  When some philosophers purport to talk about closure principles, they are really talking about transmission principles.  Consider Williamson’s “intuitive closure” principle: “knowing p1,…,pn, competently deducing q, and thereby coming to believe q is in general a way of coming to know q” (2000: 117, emphasis mine).  Closure principles can tell us that everything we competently deduce from prior knowledge itself will be known; however, only transmission principles can tell us the how, that is, that the conclusions are known in virtue of the competent deductions.  Hawthorne likewise treats closure principles as if they were transmission ones: “Our closure principles are perfectly general principles concerning how knowledge can be gained by deductive inference from prior knowledge” (2004: 36, emphasis mine).  Closure principles can tell us that everything we competently deduce from prior knowledge itself will be known; however, only transmission principles can tell us that our knowledge of these conclusions was gained by the deduction from prior knowledge.

Dretske’s 1970 paper “Epistemic Operators” introduced the epistemological world to the issue of closure failure, and his subsequent work on the topic has been extremely important.  Yet even he now admits that discussing transmission failure “provides a more revealing way” of explaining some of his key claims concerning closure failure (2005: 15).  One wonders, then, whether the literature’s greater focus on closure failure is (harmlessly?) misplaced.

c. Why Transmission is an Interesting Issue, Revisited

Although it seems salutary to appreciate the distinction between closure and transmission failure, it may be that some philosophers read too much into this distinction.  Although Wright holds that certain competent deductions are instances of transmission failure, he is “skeptical whether there are any genuine counterexamples to closure” (2002: 332; 2003: 57-8; cf. 2000: 157).  Davies seems sympathetic to a similar position at times (2000: 394) but not at others (1998: 326).  These remarks suggest the following way of explaining why transmission is an interesting issue: “Moore’s Proof seems to be a bad argument, but intuitive closure principles seem too plausible to reject.  This tension can be resolved when Moore’s Proof is treated as an instance of transmission rather than closure failure.  Moore’s Proof seems to be a bad argument and is a bad argument because it fails to transmit justification to its conclusion; it is not, however, a counterexample to intuitive closure principles.”

Smith (2009: 181) comes closest to endorsing this motivation explicitly, but even if it is not widely held, it is worth explaining why it fails.  To do so, two new closure principles need to be introduced.  Simple Closure and Simple Transmission were discussed in 4.A in order to provide a clear case in which a transmission principle is false even if its closure counterpart is true.  Yet Simple Closure is too simple to be plausible.  For example, it fails to account for defeaters (for example, relevant counterevidence).  If S deduces Q from her knowledge that P, then Simple Closure says that S knows Q.  Yet if S makes that deduction even though her total evidence supports ~Q, she will not know Q.

When philosophers defend closure principles, they typically defend, not Simple Closure, but something like:

Strong Closure: If S knows P and S competently deduces Q from P, then S knows that Q.

Simple Closure holds that knowledge is closed over deductions.  Strong Closure, on the other hand, holds that knowledge is closed over competent deductions.  Recall from 3.B that a deduction is competent just in case the premises are well justified; the premises provide deductive (so maximal) support for their conclusions; the subject knows that the premises provide deductive support; there are no relevant defeaters; and it is not premise circular.  Given that competent deductions seem, at first glance at least, to be the paradigm of good reasoning (see 3.B), it should not be surprising that philosophers defend something like Strong Closure.

The second closure principle that needs to be introduced is:

Weak Closure: If S knows P and S competently deduces Q from P, then S has some epistemic status for Q, no matter how weak.

Suppose S competently deduces Q from her knowledge that P.  Strong Closure holds that S must know Q.  Weak Closure, on the other hand, says only that S must have some positive epistemic status for Q, no matter how weak.  (It is worth noting that, despite its name, Weak Closure is not obviously a closure principle.  Closure principles say that if Pa and Rab, then Pb (see 4.A).  If there are three different epistemic properties P, Q, and R, then Weak Closure is in this form: if Pa and Rab, then Pb or Qb or Rb.  This concern can be ignored, because if Weak Closure fails to count as a closure principle, then there would only be further problems with the above motivation.)

Wright (2004), Davies (2003: 29-30), and perhaps also Smith (2009: 180-1) endorse an account of non-inferential knowledge which allows them to endorse Weak Closure but not Strong Closure.  (McLaughlin 2003: 91-2 endorses a similar view, but it is not clear that his explanation of transmission failure is compatible with even Weak Closure.)  Put simply, they hold that to have (strong) non-inferential justification for P, one must have prior entitlement for certain background assumptions.  An entitlement to some background assumption A is something like a very weak justification for A that one has automatically, or by default.  Since they suppose (as is common) that knowledge requires the strong type of justification, they also hold that non-inferential knowledge likewise requires this prior weak and default justification for background assumptions.  (The most extensive defense of this view of non-inferential justification is Wright’s 2004.  See Tucker’s 2009 for a criticism of this view as it relates to perceptual justification.)

Applied to Moore’s Proof, this view holds that, to have non-inferential knowledge that one has a hand (the premise of Moore’s Proof), she must have some prior entitlement to accept that there are material things (the conclusion of Moore’s Proof).  Since the conclusion of Moore’s Proof would not be used as a sub-premise to establish that one has hands, it would not count as premise circular.  Nonetheless, since knowing the premise would require some previous (however weak) justification for the conclusion, this view of non-inferential justification makes Moore’s Proof circular in some other sense.  Does this type of circularity prevent the premise from transmitting knowledge to the conclusion?  Wright and Davies certainly think so, but Cohen (1999:76-7, 87, nt. 52) is more optimistic.  If Wright and Davies are correct, then one has some very weak justification for the conclusion of Moore’s Proof, but they do not and cannot know this conclusion.  Since the conclusion, that there are material things, does have some weak epistemic status, Wright and Davies can endorse Weak Closure.  Yet they are forced to reject Strong Closure because they hold that one cannot know that there are material things.

The ability to endorse Weak Closure is not enough for the above way of motivating the issue of transmission failure to succeed.  Strong Closure (or some principle in the general neighborhood) is what most epistemologists find too plausible to reject.  Since Wright and Davies must reject Strong Closure, their diagnosis of Moore’s Proof cannot explain the badness of Moore’s Proof without rejecting the version of closure that most philosophers find intuitive.  (See Silins 2005: 89-95 for related discussion.)

Something like Strong Closure seems extremely plausible even to those who ultimately reject it (for example, Dretske 2005: 18).  But why does it seem so plausible?  Tucker (2010: 498-9) holds that it seems so plausible because its corresponding transmission principle seems so plausible.  Consider:

Strong Transmission: If S knows P and S competently deduces Q from P, then S knows that Q in virtue of that competent deduction.

Strong Transmission says what Strong Closure says and that the conclusion is justified in virtue of that competent deduction.  Tucker’s suggestion is that Strong Closure seems plausible because Strong Transmission seem plausible.  It seems that justification is closed over a competent deduction because it seems competent deductions must transmit justification to their conclusions, a point discussed above in section 2.B.  From this point of view, it is no surprise to find that the literature often treats closure principles as if they were transmission ones, for our intuitions concerning transmission would explain why certain closure principles seem so plausible.

5. Transmission Failure: Two Common Assumptions

It is commonly held that Moore’s Proof, the Neo-Moorean Argument, and the Zebra Argument are instances of transmission failure.  When philosophers attempt to explain why these arguments fail to transmit, they tend to make two assumptions.

a. Transmission of Warrant vs. Transmission of Justification

Much of the literature on transmission failure focuses on the transmission of warrant rather than the transmission of (doxastic) justification (see Wright 1985, 2002, 2003; Davies 1998, 2000, 2003; and Dretske 2005).  A warrant for P, roughly, is something that counts in favor of accepting P.  An evidential warrant for P is some (inferential or non-inferential) evidence that counts in favor of accepting P.  Entitlement, which was discussed in 4.B, is a type of non-evidential warrant for P, a warrant that one has by default.  One can have a warrant for P even if she does not believe P or believes P but not on the basis of the warrant.  Notice that it is propositions that are warranted relative to a person.

(Doxastic) justification, on the other hand, is a property that beliefs have.  Roughly, a belief is justified when it is held in an epistemically appropriate way.  S is justified in believing P only if (i) S has warrant for P and (ii) S’s belief in P is appropriately connected to that warrant for P.  Hence, one can have warrant for a belief even though it is not justified.  Suppose Merla has some genuine evidential warrant for her belief that Joey is innocent, so her belief satisfies (i); but her belief will not be justified if she believes that Joey is innocent solely because the Magic 8-Ball says so.  Although Merla would have warrant for Joey’s innocence, her belief in his innocence would not be connected appropriately to that warrant.  In other words, her belief would not be justified because it would not satisfy (ii).

Again, Wright, Davies, and Dretske focus on the transmission of warrant, not justification. In a representative statement, Davies maintains that “The question is whether the epistemic warrants that I have for believing the premises add up to an epistemically adequate warrant for the conclusion” (2000: 399, cf. 2003: 51). Dretske focuses more specifically on the transmission of evidential warrant.  Transmission failure, he says, is the idea “that some reasons for believing P do not transmit to things, Q, known to be implied by P” (15).  These philosophers hold that Moore’s Proof fails to transmit in the sense that it fails to make the warrant for its premise warrant for its conclusion.

These philosophers assume, however, that the failure to transmit warrant suffices for the failure to transmit justification.  In other words, they make:

Common Assumption 1: if an argument fails to transmit warrant, then it fails to transmit justification.

The difference between these two types of transmission failure is subtle.  To say that an argument fails to transmit justification is to say that an argument fails to make its conclusion justified.  To say that an argument fails to transmit warrant is to say that the argument fails to make belief in its conclusion justified in a very particular way, namely by converting warrant for the premise into warrant for the conclusion.

Davies, Wright, and, to a lesser extent, Dretske reveal this assumption when they discuss the significance of failing to transmit warrant.  Wright assumes that when an argument fails to transmit warrant, it is not an argument “whereby someone could be moved to rational [or justified] conviction of its conclusion” (2000: 140).  In one paragraph, Davies seems to suppose, at the very least, that “limitations on the transmission of epistemic warrants” suffice for “limitations on our ability to achieve knowledge [and presumably also justification] by inference” (2003: 35-6).  Although there is no one passage that illustrates this, Dretske (2005) assumes that an evidential warrant’s failing to transmit prevents knowledge (and presumably also justification) from transmitting.

This first assumption is significant because the transmission of justification seems to be the more important type of transmission. When we evaluate the quality of arguments (insofar as they are used to organize one’s beliefs) we want to know whether we can justifiably believe the conclusion in virtue of accepting the argument.  Whether an argument transmits warrant is usually relevant to this aim only insofar as it implies something about when the argument transmits justification.

Silins (2005: 87-88) and Tucker (2010: 505-7) criticize this first assumption.  Suppose that Harold’s belief in P is doxastically justified by his evidence E; he notices that P entails Q; and then he subsequently deduces Q from P.  According to Silins and Tucker, it is natural to identify Harold’s reason for accepting Q as P, not E.  Since we are supposing that P entails Q, P is presumably a warrant for Q.  But if P is Harold’s reason for Q and is itself a warrant for Q, it does not seem to matter whether the deduction transmits warrant, that is, whether the deduction makes E into a warrant for Q.  It is worth noting that, even if Common Assumption 1 is ultimately correct, Tucker and Silins still have a point: this assumption is not sufficiently obvious to be taken for granted, as Wright, Dretske, and Davies do.

b. Transmission vs. Resolving Doubt

The second common assumption may be the more important.  It says that failing to have the power to resolve doubt suffices for failing to transmit justification.  In other words:

Common Assumption 2: if an argument fails to have the power to resolve doubt, then it fails to transmit justification to its conclusion.

A deduction P therefore C has the power to resolve doubt (about its conclusion) iff it is possible for one to go from doubting C to justified belief in C solely in virtue of accepting P therefore C.  As I am using the term, one (seriously) doubts P just in case she either disbelieves or withholds judgment about P.  Withholding judgment is more than merely failing to believe or disbelieve P: it is resisting or refraining from both believing and disbelieving P, and one cannot do that unless one has considered P.

Suppose that Hillbilly has been very out of the loop the last few years, and he doubts that Obama is the president.  He then discovers that both CNN and the NY Times say that he is the president.  He might justifiably infer that, after all, Obama is the president.  This is because the argument he would accept has the power to resolve doubt.  On the other hand, the Neo-Moorean Argument, for example, does not have the power to resolve doubt.  If one doubts NM2, that she is not a brain-in-a-vat, she cannot rationally believe, NM1, that she has a hand.  So doubting the conclusion of the Neo-Moorean Argument prevents a key premise in the argument from being justified, thereby preventing the argument from justifying the conclusion.  Since the argument cannot justify its conclusion when the subject antecedently disbelieves or withholds judgment about the conclusion, it lacks the power to resolve doubt.

Wright (2002, 2003), Davies (2003), and McLaughlin (2000) make this second assumption. Wright maintains that “Intuitively, a transmissible warrant should make for the possible advancement of knowledge, or warranted belief, and the overcoming of doubt or agnosticism” (2002: 332, emphasis mine).  In another paper, he says of an example that, “The inference from A to B is thus not at the service of addressing an antecedent agnosticism about B.  So my warrant does not transmit” (2003: 63).

Davies’ (2003) Limitation Principles for the transmission of warrant are, he thinks, motivated “by making use of the idea that failure of transmission of epistemic warrant is the analogue, within the thought of a single subject, of the dialectical phenomenon of begging the question” (41).  In Davies’ view, “The speaker begs the question against the hearer if the hearer’s doubt rationally requires him to adopt background assumptions relative to which the considerations that are supposed to support the speaker’s premises no longer provide that support” (41).  Take the Zebra Argument.  If you doubted Z2, that the animal is not a cleverly disguised mule, then Davies suggests that your perceptual experience will no longer count in favor of your belief in Z1, that the animal is a zebra.  So if I offered you the Zebra Argument in order to convince you that the animal is not a cleverly disguised mule, I would beg the question against you.

It is pretty clear, as Davies’ discussion suggests, that accepting an argument that fails to be a “question-settling justification,” that is, accepting an argument lacking the power to resolve doubt, is the analogue of the dialectical phenomenon of begging the question (for example, 2003: 41-5, esp. 42).  Were I to accept the Zebra Argument when I have antecedent doubt about its conclusion, I would, as it were, beg the question against myself.  Yet Davies never provides any reason to believe that transmission failure is an analogue of begging the question.  He seems to take for granted that for something (for example, an experience or argument) to be a justification at all, it must have the power to resolve doubt.

McLaughlin’s (2000) primary concern is with the transmission of knowledge, not justification, but he seems to make a parallel assumption.  He says the Neo-Moorean Argument cannot transmit knowledge because it begs the question: “The premises fail to provide a sufficient epistemic basis on which to know the conclusion because my basis for one of the premises is dependent on the truth of the conclusion in such a way as to render the argument question begging” (104).  It is Neo-Moorean Argument’s inability to resolve doubt that makes it question-begging.  Hence, McLaughlin seems to assume that the power to resolve doubt is required for the power to make a conclusion known.

Much of the literature on transmission failure, then, operates on the assumption that the power to justify requires the power to resolve doubt.  Taking this assumption for granted was probably a reasonable thing to do at the time the literature was first published; however, this assumption is now challenged most directly by Pryor (2004), but Markie (2005: 409) and Bergmann (2006: 198-200) challenge similar assumptions in connection with easy knowledge and epistemic circularity, respectively.  Although Davies initially endorses Common Assumption 2, he seems inclined to reject it in his later work (2004: 242-3).  Those who challenge this assumption first emphasize (though not necessarily in these words) the conceptual distinction between transmission failure and the inability to resolve doubt, and then they contend that we need some special reason to think that the inability to resolve doubt suffices for transmission failure.

Sometimes philosophers press similar distinctions in different terminology, and it is worth explaining the connection with one other popular way of talking.  Some (for example, Pryor 2004: 369) hold that Moore’s Proof can transmit justification even though it is dialectically ineffective for some audiences.  An argument is dialectically effective for an audience when it is one that will transmit justification (knowledge) to the argument’s conclusion given the audience’s current beliefs, experiences, and other epistemically relevant factors.  Consider again Hillbilly’s argument that Two reliable sources, namely CNN and NY Times, say that Obama is the president; therefore, Obama is the president.  This argument is dialectically effective for Hillbilly because he has no antecedent doubt about the reliability of CNN and NY Times.  This same argument nonetheless may be dialectically ineffective for his cousin if the cousin antecedently doubts (rationally or irrationally) the reliability of these two news outlets.  Before this argument will be dialectically effective for the cousin, her antecedent doubt must be resolved.

Defenders of Moore’s Proof sometimes say that the “proof” is dialectically effective for audiences that lack antecedent doubt in the argument’s conclusion that there are no material things, but not for its intended audience, namely those skeptical of this conclusion.  Moore’s Proof fails to be dialectically effective for this skeptical audience because such skeptics tend to doubt the reliability of perception.

Appreciating the distinction between transmission failure and the inability to resolve doubt (or dialectical effectiveness) not only casts doubt on Common Assumption 2, but also provides proponents of Moore’s Proof with an error theory.  In general, an error theory attempts to explain why something seems true when it is not.  The proponent of Moore’s Proof wants to explain why Moore’s Proof seems to be an instance of transmission failure when it is not.  In other words, this error theory attempts to explain away the intuition that Moore’s Proof is an instance of transmission failure.  The proponent of this error theory will say that this intuition is partly right and partly wrong.  What it gets right is that Moore’s Proof exhibits a genuine failure, namely the failure to resolve doubt (and/or be dialectically effective for its target audience).  What it gets wrong is that Moore’s Proof is an instance of transmission failure.  Yet, since it is easy to conflate the two types of failure, it is easy to mistakenly think that Moore’s Proof is an instance of transmission failure too.

The success of this error theory depends on at least two factors.  The first is whether transmission failure and the inability to resolve doubt are in fact easily confused.  This seems plausible given the widespread tendency to implicitly endorse Common Assumption 2 without comment.  The second is whether one retains the intuition that Moore’s Proof is an instance of transmission failure.  If, after considering this error theory and carefully distinguishing transmission failure from the inability to resolve doubt, one no longer has the intuition that Moore’s Proof is a bad argument, then the error theory seems promising.  If, however, one retains the intuition that Moore’s Proof is a bad argument, it is far less plausible that the intuition of transmission failure arises from conflating transmission failure with the inability to resolve doubt.  Consequently, the error theory would seem considerably less promising.  (Wright 2008 responds to Pryor’s version of this error theory, a response which is criticized by Tucker's 2010: 523-4.)

6. References and Further Reading

  • Bergmann, Michael. 2006. Justification without Awareness. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • In Chapter 7, Bergmann makes a distinction similar to the transmission/resolving doubt distinction and uses it to defend some instances of epistemic circularity.
  • Cohen, Stewart. 1999. “Contextualism, Skepticism, and the Structure of Reasons.” Philosophical Perspectives 13: 57-89.
    • Cohen’s main goal is to defend epistemic contextualism, but he also seems to approve of a type of circularity that Davies and Wright find vicious (see 76-7, 87, nt. 52).
  • Davies, Martin. 2004. “Epistemic Entitlement, Warrant Transmission, and Easy Knowledge.” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 78: 213-45.
    • In this paper, Davies distances himself from his earlier work on transmission failure and seems sympathetic to the error theory discussed in 5.B.
  • Davies, Martin. 2003. “The Problem of Armchair Knowledge.” In Nuccetelli 23-56.
    • In this paper, Davies defends his early views concerning transmission failure, but perhaps its most useful contribution is that it considers a wide variety of cases that he holds are instances of transmission failure (see especially section 5).
  • Davies, Martin. 2000. “Externalism and Armchair Knowledge.” In Boghossian, Paul and Christopher Peacocke (eds.) 384-414.
    • This paper is probably the place to start for those interested in Davies’ early views on transmission failure.
  • Davies, Martin. 1998. “Externalism, Architecturalism, and Epistemic Warrant.” In Wright, Crispin, C. Smith, and C. Macdonald (eds.). Knowing Our Own Minds. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pgs. 321- 361.
    • Davies presents his initial views on transmission failure, which he refines in his 2000 and 2003 and then apparently reconsiders in his 2004.
  • Dretske, Fred. 2005. “The Case against Closure.” In Steup, Matthias and Ernest Sosa (eds.). Contemporary Debates in Epistemology. Malden: Blackwell Publishing, 13-25.
    • Dretske defends his view that closure principles are false, and, in sec. 1, he explains how some of what he says about closure failure in his earlier work can be better expressed in terms of transmission failure.
  • Dretske, Fred. 1970. “Epistemic Operators” Journal of Philosophy 67: 1007-23.
    • Dretske introduces closure failure as an issue for discussion, but his 2005 provides a simpler introduction to the closure failure issue.
  • Hawthorne, John. 2005. “The Case for Closure.” In Steup, Matthias and Ernest Sosa (eds.). Contemporary Debates in Epistemology. Malden: Blackwell Publishing, 26-42.
    • Hawthorne defends intuitive closure principles and criticizes Dretske’s views regarding closure (and transmission) failure.
  • Lackey, Jennifer. 2006.  “Introduction.” In Lackey, Jennifer and Ernest Sosa (eds.). The Epistemology of Testimony. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • In Section 3, Lackey briefly discusses some of the transmission issues concerning testimony.
  • Markie, Peter J. “Easy Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 70: 406-16.
    • Markie discusses some competent deductions that seem to be instances of transmission failure (though he does not use that terminology), and he provides an error theory of the sort discussed in section 5.B above.
  • McKinsey, Michael. 2003. “Transmission of Warrant and Closure of Apriority.”
    • In Nuccetelli 97-115.  McKinsey responds to Wright (2000) and Davies’ (1998, 2000, 2003) charge that McKinsey’s Paradox is an instance of transmission failure.
  • McLaughlin, Brian. 2003. “McKinsey’s Challenge, Warrant Transmission, and Skepticism.”  In Nuccetelli 79-96.
    • McLaughlin provides an objection to Wright’s 2000 conditions for transmission failure, which convinces Wright to modify those conditions in his later work.  It also provides a careful discussion of whether McKinsey’s Paradox is an instance of transmission failure.
  • McLaughlin, Brian. 2000. “Skepticism, Externalism, and Self-Knowledge.” The Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 74: 93-118.
    • On pages 104-5, McLaughlin connects transmission failure with question-begging and claims that the Neo-Moorean argument is an instance of transmission failure.
  • Nuccetelli, Susana (ed.). 2003. New Essays on Semantic Externalism and Self-Knowledge. Cambridge: MIT Press.
    • Several chapters of this collection were referenced in this article.
  • Pryor, James. 2004. “What’s Wrong with Moore’s Argument.” Philosophical Issues 14: 349-77.
    • Pryor defends Moore’s Proof from the charge of transmission failure, which includes a very careful discussion of the error theory discussed in 5.B.
  • Silins, Nicholas. 2005. “Transmission Failure Failure.” Philosophical Studies 126: 71-102.
    • Silins defends the Zebra Argument from the charge of transmission failure and provides detailed criticisms of the views of Wright and Davies.
  • Smith, Martin. 2009. “Transmission Failure Explained.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 79: 164-89.
    • Smith provides an account of transmission failure in terms of safety and reliability.  A full appreciation of Smith’s view requires at least some background in modal logic, particularly with counterfactuals, or subjunctive conditionals.
  • Tucker, Chris. 2010. "When Transmission Fails." Philosophical Review 119: 497-529.
    • Tucker defends the Neo-Moorean and Zebra arguments by developing and defending a very permissive account of transmission failure. Much of this entry is merely a simplified version of the first half of Tucker's 2010 paper.
  • Tucker, Chris. 2009. “Perceptual Justification and Warrant by Default.”  Australasian Journal of Philosophy 87: 445-63.
    • This paper attacks the view of non-inferential justification that Wright, and, to a lesser extent, Smith, Davies, and McLaughlin (2003) assume in their work on transmission failure.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 2000. Knowledge and Its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • This book contains some important work on closure failure that is equally work on transmission failure.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2008. “The Perils of Dogmatism.” Themes from G. E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 25-48.
    • Wright criticizes an alternative to his account of non-inferential justification and, on page 38, he criticizes Pryor’s version of the error theory discussed in 5.B.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2004. “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 78: 167- 212.
    • Wright’s extended defense of his account of non-inferential justification.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2003. “Some Reflections on the Acquisition of Warrant by Inference.” In Nuccetelli 57-78.
    • The place to start for those interested in understanding Wright’s account of transmission failure as it relates to McKinsey’s Paradox and content externalism.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2002. “(Anti)-Sceptics Simple and Subtle: G. E. Moore and John McDowell.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 65: 330-348.
    • The place to start for those interested in Wright’s account of transmission failure as it relates to perceptual justification.
  • Wright, Crispin. 2000. “Cogency and Question-Begging: Some Reflections on McKinsey’s Paradox and Putnam’s Proof.” Philosophical Issues 10: 140-63.
    • Wright provides a transmission failure principle which he refines in his 2002 and 2003 in light of McLaughlin’s 2003 criticism.
  • Wright, Crispin. 1985. “Facts and Certainty.” Proceedings of the British Academy, 429-472. Reprinted in Williams, Michael (ed.). 1993. Skepticism. Aldershot: Dartmouth Publishing Company Limited, pgs. 303-346.
    • Wright’s earliest work on transmission failure and perhaps the first paper to distinguish between closure and transmission principles.  Since Wright’s main focus is not transmission failure, you might start with one of Wright’s later papers unless one is very interested in the full details of Wright’s broadly Wittgensteinian epistemology.

Author Information

Chris Tucker
University of Auckland
New Zealand

Plato: Organicism

Organicism is the position that the universe is orderly and alive, much like an organism. According to Plato, the Demiurge creates a living and intelligent universe because life is better than non-life and intelligent life is better than mere life. It is the perfect animal.  In contrast with the Darwinian view that the emergence of life and mind are accidents of evolution, the Timaeus holds that the universe, the world, is necessarily alive and intelligent. And mortal organisms are a microcosm of the great macrocosm.

Although Plato is most famous today for his theory of Forms and for the utopian and elitist political philosophy in his Republic, his later writings Plato promote an organicist cosmology which, prima facie, conflicts with aspects of his theory of Forms and of his signature political philosophy. The organicism is found primarily in the Timaeus, but also in the Philebus, Statesman, and Laws.

Because the Timaeus was the only major dialogue of Plato available in the West during most of the Middle Ages, during much of that period his cosmology was assumed by scholars to represent the mature philosophy of Plato, and when many Medieval philosophers refer to Platonism they mean his organicist cosmology, not his theory of Forms. Despite this, Plato’s organicist cosmology is largely unknown to contemporary philosophers, although many scholars have recently begun to show renewed interest.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Whitehead’s Reading of Plato
    2. Greek Organicism
  2. Plato’s Cosmogony and Cosmology
    1. Creation of the World Animal
    2. The Mortal Organism as Microcosm of the Macrocosm
    3. Creation as Procreation
    4. Emergence of Kosmos from Chaos
  3. Relevance to Plato’s Philosophy
    1. Relevance to Plato’s Aesthetics
    2. Relevance to Plato’s Ethics
    3. Relevance to Plato’s Political Philosophy
    4. Relevance to Plato’s Account of Health and Medicine
    5. Relevance to Plato’s Theory of Forms
  4. Influence of Plato’s Cosmology
    1. Transition to Aristotle’s Organicism
    2. Importance for Contemporary Philosophy
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

a. Whitehead’s Reading of Plato

In his 1927-28 Gifford Lectures, Whitehead (1978) makes the startling suggestion that Plato’s philosophy is akin to a philosophy of organism. This is surprising to many scholars because Plato’s signature doctrine, the theory of Forms, would seem to be as far removed from a philosophy of organism as possible. On the usual understanding of the theory of Forms, reality is divided into a perfect, eternal, unchanging, world of  Forms or universals, and a separate, finite, imperfect world of perceptible particulars, where the latter is an image of the former and is, in some obscure way, unreal, or less real, than the Forms.  Since living things requires growth and change, and since, according to the theory of Forms, these are mere images of the only genuine realities, the Forms, it would seem there can be no fundamental place for living organisms in Plato’s ontology.

The case for Whitehead’s thesis is based on Plato’s Timaeus, where he  compares the kosmos to a living organism, but also, to a lesser degree, on the Laws, Statesman, Philebus and Critias.   Since the Timaeus is concerned with the temporal world, generally thought to be denigrated by the “other-worldly” Plato, its relevance to Plato’s philosophy has been doubted.   First, the cosmology of the Timaeus is not even presented by Socrates, but by Timaeus, a 5th century Pythagorean.   Second, the Timaeus represents its organicist cosmology as a mere probable story.    Third, although Plato employs myths in most of his dialogues, these are generally combined with discursive argument, but the Timaeus is “myth from beginning to end” (Robin, 1996).   For these reasons, many scholars hold that the Timaeus represents a digression into physical speculations that have more to do with the natural sciences per se than they do with philosophy proper (Taylor, 1928).    Russell (1945) allows that the Timaeus deserves to be studied because it has had such great influence on the history of ideas, but holds that “as philosophy it is unimportant.”  The case is further complicated by the controversy over the longstanding view that the Timaeus is a later period dialogue.  For a discussion of these stylometric and chronological disputes see Kraut (1992), Brandwood (1992), and Meinwald (1992).

It is worth remembering, however, that throughout most of the Middle Ages, the Timaeus was the only Platonic dialogues widely available in the West and most scholars at that time assumed that it represents Plato’s mature views (Knowles, 1989).   Second, the dialogue in the Timaeus appears to take up where that of the Republic leaves off, suggesting that Plato himself saw a continuity between the views in the two works.  It is also worth pointing out that some physicists, such as Heisenberg (1958),  have claimed that the Timaeus provided inspiration for their rejection of the materialism of Democritus in favor of the mathematical forms of Plato and the Pythagoreans (see also Brisson and Meyerstein, 1995).   For these and other reasons, a growing number of scholars have, despite the controversies, begun to return to the Timaeus with renewed philosophical interest (Vlastos, 1975; Ostenfield, 1982; Annas, 1999; Sallis, 1999; Carone, 2000; and so forth.).

b. Greek Organicism

In his introduction to Plato’s works, Cairns (1961)  points out that the Greek view, as far back as we have records, is that the world is orderly and alive.  From this perspective, the failure to appreciate Plato’s organicism is part and parcel of a failure to appreciate Greek organicism more generally. For example, whereas modern scholars view the Milesians as forerunners of modern materialism (Jeans, 1958), the Milesians held that matter is alive (Cornford, 1965; Robin, 1996).  Similarly, Anaximenes did not hold that air is the basis of all things in the same sense, or for the same reasons, that a modern materialist might hold such a view.  He views air as breath and sees air as the basis of all things because he sees the world as a living thing and therefore “wants it to breath” (Robin, 1996; Cornford, 1966). Pythagoras too, who exerted great influence on Plato, saw the world as a living breathing being (Robinson, 1968).    Cornford (1966) notes that Plato’s description in the Timaeus of his world animal as a “well rounded sphere” has been seen by some scholars as the best commentary on Parmenides’ comparison of his One Being to a perfect sphere (raising the possibility of a Parmenidean organicism).    Finally, by stressing that fire is the basis of all things, Heraclitus did not mean that fire is the material out of which all things are made.  His fire is an “ever living” fire (Burnet, 1971).  Similar points could be made about other pre-Socratic philosophers.   The Greek tendency to view the world as a living thing is rooted in the fact that the early Greek notion of nature, physis, was closer in meaning to life than to matter (Cornford, 1965).   This is why, as far back as Hesiod, procreation plays such a prominent role in Greek creation stories, as it does in the Timaeus (Section 2c.).   From this perspective, it is not surprising that Plato develops an organicist cosmology.    It would be surprising if he did not have one.

2. Plato’s Cosmogony and Cosmology

a. Creation of the World Animal

The Timaeus describes the world (kosmos) as a created living being.  The world is created by the “Demiurge  [ho demiourgos]” who follows an “eternal pattern” reminiscent of Plato’s Forms (Carone, 2000).  The materials out of which the kosmos is fashioned are already present.    The eternal patterns or Forms, the Demiurge himself, and the materials, all pre-exist the creation.  Thus, Plato’s Demiurge is not omnipotent, but is more like a craftsman, limited both by the eternal patterns and by the prior matter.  The creative act consists in putting “intelligence in soul and soul in body” in accord with the eternal patterns.  The soul in the Timaeus and Laws is understood as the principle of self-motion.

The pre-existing materials are described as “chaos.”   By “chaos” Plato does not mean the complete absence of order, but a kind of order, perhaps even a mechanical order, opposed to Reason.   This “chaotic” tendency survives the imposition of Form and is always threatening to break out and undermine the rational order of the world.   For this reason Plato’s kosmos exhibits a dynamical quality quite alien to modern thought.

The Demiurge creates a living and intelligent world because life is better than non-life and intelligent life is better than mere life.  It is “the perfect animal.”  In contrast with the Darwinian view that the emergence of life and mind are accidents of evolution, the Timaeus holds that the world is necessarily alive and intelligent.

The Timaeus identifies three different kinds of souls, the rational (eternal) soul, the spirited soul, and the plantlike soul capable of sensation but not of genuine self-motion.   The world-animal possesses the highest and most perfect kind of soul, the rational soul, but it also shares in the two lower types of soul as well.  The world may be the perfect animal, but it is not a perfect being because it possesses the lower types of soul.  The presence of these lower types of soul helps to explain the imperfection in the world.

The Timaeus holds that the world is “solitary.”   The Demiurge only creates one world, not because he is stingy, but because he can only create the best and there can only be one best world.   Since it is solitary, there is nowhere for it to go and nothing for it to perceive.   The perfect-animal has, therefore, no external limbs or sense organs.

The Demiurge gives the world the most suitable shape, that is, it is a sphere with each point on the circumference equidistant from the center.   Since it has no need of sense organs or limbs, it is perfectly smooth.  Although the pre-existing visible body is also a sphere, it turns out that a sphere is also the most suitable choice of shape for the perfect animal (Sect. 4c).  The Demiurge imposes an order on that pre-existing material sphere that makes it suitable for the introduction of a soul.    Thus, Plato does not deny that there are material or mechanical conditions for life and mind.  He only insists that these are subordinated in the world to the more basic rule by reason (McDonough, 1991).

The Demiurge makes the perfect animal in the shape of a sphere since a sphere “is the most like itself of all figures” and that makes for the most beautiful figure.  Unlike the modern view that values are a subjective coloring imposed by the human mind (Putnam, 1990), Plato’s kosmos is intrinsically beautiful and good.   Plato’s science of nature does not seek to strip things of value in order to see them “objectively”, but, rather, to describe the intrinsic values writ large in the perfect visible cosmic organism (Sect. 3a-3c).

The Demiurge puts the soul in the center of the sphere, but it “diffuses” throughout the entire sphere.   The Demiurge synchronizes the two spheres “center to center.”  Thus, Plato distinguishes between the organism’s spiritual center and its bodily center, and holds that these must be made, by the Demiurge, to correspond with each other.  This is an early version of the “correlation thesis” (Putnam, 1981), the view that there must be a correspondence between the mental and material states of the organism.   That which is produced directly by intelligence may only have a teleological explanation, while that caused by matter not controlled by intelligence may have only a physical explanation, but that which is produced by the informing of matter by intelligence admits of both a teleological and a physical explanation.   In that case, the teleological and physical “spheres” must correspond with each other.  The world-animal is One in the sense that it possesses an organic unity by virtue of its central order-imposing soul.

Since the kosmos is a perfect animal,  and since an animal has parts, the world is ”a perfect whole of perfect parts.”   The kosmos is a whole of parts because it “the very image of that whole of which all the animals and their tribes are portions.”  The “whole” of which the kosmos is an image is called “the Form of the Intelligible Animal."

The Form of the Intelligible Animal contains “all intelligible beings, just as this [visible] world contains all other visible creatures.”  The perfect animal must embrace all possible species of “intelligible beings.”   Thus, Plato’s world-animal is actually a whole ecosystem of interrelated animals.    It should not, however, be assumed that the cosmic animal is not also a single organism.   Although the human body is, in one sense, a single organism, it is, in another sense, a whole system of interrelated organisms (the individual cells of the body), which combine to form one more perfect organism.

The view that the Form of the intelligible animal contains all intelligible beings suggests that only animals are intelligible.   Matter as such is not intelligible.  A material thing is only intelligible because it instantiates a Form.  The Timaeus suggests that the total recipe for the instantiation of the Forms is a living organism.  The ideas that only living things are intelligible and that matter per se is unintelligible are foreign to the modern mind.   Nonetheless, Plato sees a close connection between life and intelligibility.

Since there is nothing outside the perfect animal, it exists “in itself.”  Since it exists “in itself,” it is self sufficient in the visible world.  It does depend on the Forms, but it does not depend on anything more basic in the perceptible world.   Since it moves, but is an image of the self-sufficient Forms, it moves in the most self-sufficient way, that is, it is self- moving.   Since there is nothing outside it, it can only move “within its own limits,”  that is, it can only rotate around its own axis.    The circular motion of the perfect animal is the best perceptible image of the perfection and self-sameness of the eternal Forms.

Since the perfect animal is intelligent, it thinks.   Since it is self-moving, it is a self-moving thinker.   Since it is self-sufficient in the visible world, it is, in that realm, absolute spontaneity.   Plato’s characterization of the perfect animal as a “sensible God” expresses the fact that it possesses these divine qualities of self-sufficiency, self movement, and absolute spontaneity deriving from its participation in an eternal pattern.

The Timaeus presents a  complex mathematical account, involving the mixing of various types of being, in various precise proportions, of the creation of the “spherical envelope to the body of the universe,” that is, the heavens.  The more orderly movements of the heavenly bodies are better suited than earthly bodies to represent the eternal patterns, but they are not completely ordered.   In addition to the perfect circular movements of the stars, there is also the less orderly movement of the planets.  Plato distinguishes these as “the same” and “the different.”   Whereas the stars display invariable circular movements, the planets move in diverse manners, a different motion for each of the seven planets.   Thus, the movement of the stars is “undivided,” while that of  the plants is divided into separate diverse motions.   Since the former is superior, the movements of the different are subordinated to those of “the same.”  The entirely regular movement of “the same” is the perfect image of the eternal patterns, while the movement of  “the different” is a manifestation of the imperfect material body of the kosmos.   Nevertheless, since “the different” are in the heavens, they are still much more orderly than the “chaotic” movements of bodies on earth.   Although this account is plainly unbelievable, it sheds light on his concept of an organism and his views about intelligence.

To take one example, Plato invokes the dichotomy of “the same” and “the different” to explain the origins of knowledge and true belief.   Because the soul is composed of both “the same” and “the different,” she is capable of recognizing the sameness or difference in anything that “has being.”  Both knowledge and true opinion achieve truth, for “reason works with equal truth whether she is in the sphere of the diverse or of the same,” but intelligence and knowledge, the work of “the same,” are still superior to true belief, the work of “the different."   Insofar as the heavens display the movements of “the same,” the world animal achieves intelligence and knowledge, but  insofar as “the circle of the diverse” imparts the “intimations of sense” to the soul mere true belief is achieved.    Plato is, in effect, describing a kind of celestial mechanism to explain the origins of the perfect animal’s knowledge on the one hand and true belief on the other.   His view implies that an organism must  be imperfect if it is to have true beliefs about a corporeal world and that these imperfections must be reflected in its “mechanism” of belief.

Because of their perfect circular motions, the heavens are better suited than earthly movements to measure time.    Thus, time is “the moving image of eternity.”  This temporal “image of eternity” is eternal and “moves in accord with number” while eternity itself “rests in unity."  But time is not a representation of just any Form.  It is an image of the Form of the Intelligible Animal.   Since time is measured by the movement of the perfect bodies in the heavens, and since that movement constitutes the life of the perfect animal, time is measured by the movement of the perfect life on display in the heavens, establishing a connection between time and life carried down to Bergson (1983).

b. The Mortal Organism as Microcosm of the Macrocosm

The Demiurge creates the world-animal, but leaves the creation of mortal animals to the "created gods,” by which Plato may mean the earth (female) and the sun (male).  Since the created gods imitate the creator, mortal animals are also copies of the world-animal.   Thus, man is a microcosm of the macrocosm, a view that extends from the pre-Socratics (Robinson, 1968), through Scholastic philosophy (Wulf, 1956) and the Renaissance (Cassirer, 1979), to Leibniz (1968), Wittgenstein (1966), Whitehead (1978), and others.

Although plants and the lesser animals are briefly discussed in the Timaeus, the only mortal organism described in detail is man.  Since imperfections are introduced at each stage of copying, man is less perfect than the cosmic-animal, the lesser animals are less perfect than man, and plants are less perfect than the lesser animals.  This yields a hierarchy of organisms, a “great chain of being,” arranged from the most perfect world-animal at the top to the least perfect organisms at the bottom (Lovejoy, 1964).

Since an ordinary organism is a microcosm of the macrocosm, the structure of a mortal organism parallels that of the macrocosm.  Since the structure of the macrocosm is the structure of the heavens (broadly construed to include the earth at the center of the heavenly spheres), one need not rely on empirical studies of ordinary biological organisms.  Since the Timaeus holds that the archetype of an organism is “writ large” in the heavens, the science of astronomy is the primary guide to the understanding of living things. In this respect, our modern view owes more to Aristotle, who accorded greater dignity to the empirical study of ordinary living things (Hamilton, 1964, p. 32).

Since the macrocosm is a sphere with the airy parts at the periphery and the earth at the center, ordinary organisms also have a spherical structure with the airy parts at the periphery and the heavier elements at the center.   Since an ordinary organism is less perfect than the world animal, its spherical shape is distorted.   Although there are three kinds of souls, these are housed in separate bodily spheres.   The rational, or immortal, soul is located in the sphere of the head.  The two mortal souls are encased in the sphere of the thorax and the sphere of the abdomen.   The division of the mortal soul into two parts is compared with the division of a household into the male and female “quarters.”

The head contains the first principle of life.  The soul is united with the body at its center.  Since Plato uses “marrow” as a general term for the material at the center of a seed, the head contains the brain “marrow” suited to house the most divine soul.  There are other kinds of “marrows” at the centers of the chest and abdomen.    The sphere is the natural shape for an animal because the principle of generation takes the same form as a seed, and most seeds are spherical.  The head is a “seed” that gives birth to immortal thoughts.  The thorax and abdomen are “seeds” that give birth to their own appropriate motions.

The motions in the various organic systems imitate the circular motions of the heavens.   Respiration is compared to “the rotation of a wheel."    Since there can be no vacuum, air taken in at one part forces the air already there to move out of its place, which forces the air further down to move, and so on.  Plato gives a similar account of the circulatory system.  The blood is compelled to move by the action of the heart in the center of the chest.  “[T]he particles of the blood … which are contained within the frame of the animal as in a sort of heaven, are compelled to imitate the motion of the universe.”    The blood circulates around the central heart just as the stars circulate around the central earth.   Similar accounts are given of ingestion and evacuation.   The action of the lungs, heart, and so forth, constitutes the bodily mechanism that implements the organic telos.    In the Phaedo and Laws, Plato compares the Earth, the “true mother of us all,” to an organism with its own circulatory systems of subterranean rivers of water and lava.  The organic model of the heavens is the template for an organic model of the geological structure of the earth.

Since the perfect animal has no limbs or sense organs, “the other six [the non-circular] motions were taken away from him.”  Since there is no eternal pattern for these chaotic motions associated with animal life, they are treated as unintelligible.  There is, for Plato, no science of chaos.  His remarks are consistent with the view that there can be a mechanics of the non-circular bodily motions, but since such a mechanics cannot give the all- important reason for the motion it so does not qualify as a science in Plato’s sense.

Since the rise of the mechanistic world view in the 18th century, it has been impossible for modern thinkers to take Plato’s cosmology seriously.  It cannot, however, be denied that it is a breathtaking vision.   If nothing else, it is a startling reminder how differently ancient thinkers viewed the universe.   According to the Timaeus, we on earth live at the center of one unique perfect cosmic organism, in whose image we have been created, and whose nature and destiny has been ordained by imperceptible transcendent forces from eternity.  When we look up at the night sky, we are not seeing mere physical bodies moving in accord with blind mechanical laws, but, rather, are, quite literally, seeing the radiant airy periphery of that single perfect cosmic life, the image of our own (better) selves, from which we draw our being, our guidance, and our destiny.

Finally, Plato is, in the Timaeus, fashioning important components of our concept of an organism, a concept which survives even when his specific quaint theories, do not.  For example, biologists have noted that animals, especially those, like Plato’s perfect animal, that have no need of external sense organs or limbs, tend towards a spherical shape organized around a center (Buchsbaum, 1957).  Indeed, central state materialism, the modern view that the intelligence is causally traceable to the neural center, is, arguably, a conceptual descendent of Plato’s notion of an organism organized around a center.

c. Creation as Procreation


Whereas in his earlier dialogues Plato had distinguished Forms and perceptible objects, the latter copies of the former,  the Timaeus announces the need to posit yet another kind of being, “the Receptacle,” or “nurse of all generation.”  The Receptacle is like the Forms insofar as it is a “universal nature” and is always “the same,” but it must be “formless” so that it can “take every variety of form.”   The Receptacle is likened to “the mother” of all generation, while “the source or spring” of generation, the Demiurge, is likened to the father.   In the Timaeus, the creation of the world is not a purely intellectual act, but, following the sexual motif in pre-Socratic cosmogony, it is modeled on sexual generation.

Plato’s argument for positing the Receptacle is that since visible objects do not exist in themselves, and since they do not exist in the Forms, they must exist “in another,” and the Receptacle is this “other” in which visible objects exist, that is, the argument for positing the Receptacle is premised on the ontologically  dependent status of visible objects.

Since the perfect motion is circular, generation too moves in a circle.  This is true of the generation of the basic elements, earth, air, fire, and water, out of each other, but it is also true of animal generation.  Since the parents of a certain type only generate offspring of the same type, the cycle of procreation always returns, in a circular movement, to the same point from which it started    It is only in creating a copy of themselves, which then go on to do that same, that mortal creatures partake of the eternal (Essentially the same picture is found in Plato’s Symposium and in Aristotle’s Generation of Animals).  Since the sexual act presupposes the prior existence of the male and female principles, the procreation model also explains why Plato’s Demiurge does not create from nothing.

Plato identifies the Receptacle with space, but also suggests that the basic matters, such as fire, are part of its nature, so it cannot be mere space.   Although Plato admits that it somehow “partakes of the intelligible,” he also states that it “is hardly real” and that we only behold it “as in a dream.”   Despite the importance of this view in the Timaeus, Plato is clearly puzzled, and concludes that the Receptacle is only apprehended by a kind of “spurious reason.”   Given his comparison of the receptacle to the female principle, he may think that visible objects are dependent on “another” in something like the sense in which a foetus is dependent on the mother’s womb.  On the other hand, Plato admits that these are murky waters and it is doubtful that the sexual imagery can be taken literally.

d. Emergence of Kosmos from Chaos

The Western intellectual tradition begins, arguably, with the cosmogony in Hesiod’s Theogony, according to which the world emerges from chaos.  A similar story is found in Plato’s creation story in the Timaeus, where, in the beginning, everything is in “disorder” and any “proportion” between things is accidental.   None of the kinds, such as fire, water, and so forth, exist.  These had to be “first set in order” by God, who then, out of them, creates the cosmic animal.   Since the root meaning of the Greek “kosmos” is orderly arrangement, the Timaeus presents a classic picture of the emergence of order out of chaos.

The doctrine of emergent evolution, associated with Bergson (1983), Alexander (1920), and Morgan (1923), is the view that the laws of nature evolve over time (Nagel, 1979).   Since, in the Timaeus, the laws of nature are not fixed by the conditions in the primordial “chaos,” but only arise, under the supervision of the Demiurge, in a temporal process, Plato’s cosmology appears to anticipate these later views.  Mourelatos (1986) argues that emergentism is present in the later pre-Socratic philosophers.  Although emergentism has been out of fashion for some time, it has recently been enjoying a revival (See Kim, Beckermann, and Flores, 1992; McDonough, 2002; Clayton and Davies, 2006, and so forth).

3. Relevance to Plato’s Philosophy

a. Relevance to Plato’s Aesthetics

Since reason dictates that the best creation is the perfect animal, the living kosmos is the most beautiful created thing.   Since the perfect animal is a combination of soul and body, these must be combined in the right proportion.   The correct proportion of these constitutes the organic unity of the organism.   Thus, the beauty of an organism consists in its organic unity.   Since other mortal organisms are microcosms of the macrocosm, the standard of beauty for a mortal organism is set by the beauty of the kosmos.   The beauty of a human being is, in effect, modeled on the beauty of a world.

There is a link between beauty and pleasure, but pleasure is derivative.  Since beauty is a matter of  rational proportion, a rational person naturally finds the sight of beauty pleasurable.   Thus, a rational person finds a well proportioned organism beautiful, where the relevant proportions include not merely physical proportions but the most basic proportion between body and soul.   Finally, since an organism has an organic unity, rationality, beauty, health and virtue can only occur together.    Thus, Plato’s aesthetics shades into his ethics, his view of medicine, and his conception of philosophy itself.

b. Relevance to Plato’s Ethics

Perhaps the most basic objection to Plato’s ethics is the charge that his view that the Forms are patterns for conduct is empty of content.   What can it mean for a changeable, corporeal, mortal, living creature to imitate a non-living immaterial, eternal, unchanging, abstract object?   Plato’s organicist cosmology addresses this gap in his ethical theory.

Since the kosmos is copied from the Form of the Intelligible Animal, and since man is a microcosm of the macrocosm, there is a kinship between the rational part of man and the cosmic life on display in the heavens.   There is a close link, foreign to the modern mind, between ethics and astronomy (Carone, 2000).  This explains why, in the Theaetetus, Socrates states that the philosopher spends their time “searching the heavens.”

Specifically, the ethical individual must strive to imitate the self-sufficiency of the kosmos.  Since the most fundamental dimension of self-sufficiency is self-movement, the ethical individual must strive to be self-moving (like the heavenly bodies).  Since the eternal soul is the rational soul, not the animal or vegetable soul, the ethical individual aims at the life of self-moving rational contemplation.  Since the highest form of the rational life is the life of philosophy, the ethical life coincides with the life of philosophy.

As self-moving, the ethical individual is not moved by external forces, but by the “laws of destiny.”  One must not interpret this in a modern sense.  Plato’s ethical individual is not a cosmic rebel.   The ethical individual does not have their own individualistic destiny.  Since a mortal living being is a microcosm of the macrocosm, it shares in the single law of destiny of the kosmos.  Socrates had earlier stated the analogous view in the Meno that “all nature is akin.”  There is a harmony between man’s law of destiny and that of the kosmos.   Because of their corrupt bodily nature, human beings have fallen away from their cosmic destiny.   Thus, the fundamental ethical imperative is that human beings must strive to reunite with the universal cosmic life from which they have fallen away, the archetype of which is displayed in the heavens.   The ethical law for man is but a special case of the universal law of destiny that applies to all life in the universe.

The bad life is the unbalanced life.   A life is unbalanced when it falls short of the ideal organic unity.   Thus, evil is a kind of disease of the soul.   Since the body is the inferior partner in the union of soul and body, evil results from the undue influence of the body on the soul  Since body and soul are part of an organic unity, and since the soul does not move without the body and vice versa, the diseases of the soul are diseases of the body and vice versa.  Due regard must be given to the bodily needs, but since the soul is the superior partner in that union, the proper proportion is achieved when the rational soul rules the body.   The recipe for a good life is the same as the recipe for a healthy organism.   Thus, the ethics of the Timaeus shades into an account of health and medicine (Sect. 3c).   Since the ethical individual is the philosopher, the account of all of these shades in to account of the philosopher as well.   The ethical individual, the healthy individual, the beautiful individual, and the philosopher are one and the same.

The cosmology of the Timaeus may also serve to counterbalance the elitism in Plato’s earlier ethical views.  Whereas, in Plato’s middle period dialogues, it is implied that goodness and wisdom are only possible for the best human beings (philosophers), the Timaeus suggests the more egalitarian view that since human life is a microcosm of the macrocosm, ethical salvation is possible for all human beings (Carone, 2000).

Plato’s organicism also suggests a more optimistic view of ethical life than is associated with orthodox Platonism.  Whereas, in Plato’s middle period dialogues, the ethical person is represented to be at the mercy of an evil world, and unlikely to be rewarded for their good efforts, the Timaeus posits a “cosmic mechanism” in which virtue is its own reward (Carone, 2000).   Although Socrates may be victimized by unjust men, the ultimate justice is meted out, not in the human law courts, but in the single universal cosmic life.

On the more negative side, Plato’s celestial organicism does commit him to a kind of astrology:  The Demiurge “assigned to each soul a star, and having there placed them as in a chariot, he … declared to them the laws of destiny.”  Taken literally, this opens Plato to easy caricature, but taken symbolically, as it may well be intended, it is a return to the Pythagorean idea that ethical salvation is achieved, not by setting oneself up in individual opposition to the world, but by reuniting with the cosmic rhythm from which one has fallen away (Allen, 1966).   Although this may look more like a cult or religion to modern thinkers, it is worth noting that it does anticipate the criticism of  the human-centered vision of ethics by the modern “deep ecology” movement (Naess, 1990).

c. Relevance to Plato’s Political Philosophy

Since Plato sees an analogy between the polis and the kosmos (Carone, 2000), and since the kosmos is a living organism, Plato’s concept of organism illuminates his account of the polis.   Just as the kosmos is a combination of Reason (Nous) and Necessity (chaos), so too is the polis.   Just as Demiurge brings the kosmos into being by making the primordial chaos submit to Reason, so too, the Statesman brings the polis into being by making the chaos of human life submit to reason.  Carone (2000) suggests that politics, for Plato, is itself is a synthesis of Reason and Necessity.   It is, in this connection, significant, that in Greek, the word “Demiurge” can mean magistrate (Carone, 2000). See Plato's Political Philosophy.

d. Relevance to Plato’s Account of Health and Medicine

Since an organism is an organic whole, beauty, virtue, wisdom, and health must occur together.   Just as Plato’s organicism issues in an aesthetics and an ethics, it also issues in an account of medicine.   Health is a state of orderly bodily motions induced by the soul, while disease is a state of disorder induced by the chaos of the body.   The diseases of the soul, such as sexual intemperance, are caused by the undue influence of the body on the soul, with the consequence that a person who is foolish is not so voluntarily.

Since an organism is an organic whole, one does not treat the heart in order to cure the person.  One treats the whole person in order to cure the heart.   Since the union of body and soul is fundamental, health requires the correct proportion between them.  Since the enemy of health is the chaos of the body, health is achieved by imitating the rational pattern of the heavens.   Since the heavens are self-moving, that motion is the best which is self-produced.   Thus, a self-imposed “regimen” of rational discipline and gymnastic, including the arts and all philosophy, is the optimal way to manage disease.

Unfortunately, most professors of medicine fail to see that disease is a natural part of life.  Although mortal organisms live within limits, professors of medicine are committed to the impossible task of contravening these limits by external force, medications, surgery, and so forth.  By ignoring an organism’s inherent limits, they fail to respect the inner laws of harmony and proportion in nature.   Just as self-movement is, in general, good, movement caused by some external agency is, in general, bad.   Since an organism is a self-moving rational ordering with its own inherent limits, the best course is to identify the unhealthy habits that have led to the malady and institute a “regimen” to restore the organism to its natural cycles.   In a concession to common sense, however, Plato does allow that intervention by external force may be permissible when the disease is “very dangerous.”

Plato’s view of medicine may seem quaint, but since, on his view, beauty, health, virtue, and wisdom are aspects of (or, perhaps, flow from) a fundamental condition of organic unity, his views on medicine shed light on his aesthetics, ethics, and his conception of philosophy.   Health is, in various Platonic dialogues (Republic 444c-d, Laws, 733e, and so forth.), associated with the philosophical and virtuous life.  The fact that the Timaeus’ recipe for health includes a strong dose of “all philosophy” betokens Plato’s view that health, like wisdom and virtue, are specific states of an organism that derive, and can only derive, from a certain central unifying power of the philosophic soul.

e. Relevance to Plato’s Theory of Forms

Although it may seem that Plato’s organicism is irrelevant to his theory of Forms, or even that it is incompatible with it, it is arguable that it supplements and strengthens the theory of Forms.  The three main tenets of the theory of Forms are that (1) the world of Forms is separate from the world of perceptible objects (the two-world view), (2)  perceptible objects are images or copies of the Forms, and (3)  perceptible objects are unreal or “less real” than the Forms.

With regard to the first thesis, there appears to be a tension between Plato’s organicism and the two-world view.  f the kosmos is perfect and beautiful, not infer that the Forms are not separate from the kosmos but are present in it?   On the other hand, since Aristotle says in the Metaphysics that Plato never abandoned the two-world theory, it is prudent to leave the first thesis unchanged.  Even if Plato’s organicism undercuts some of the original motivations for the two-world view, it does not require its rejection (Sect. 4b).

Although Plato’s organicism does not require a rejection of the second thesis, the view that perceptible objects are images of the Forms, it puts it in a different light. Rather, it suggests that perceptible objects are not images of Forms in the sense in which a photograph is an image of a man, but in something like the sense in which a child is an image of its parents (Sect. 2c).   From this perspective, the orthodox reading of Plato relies on a one-sided view of the image-model and thereby makes Plato’s theory of Forms appear to denigrate the perceptible world more than it really must do (Patterson, 1985).

Plato’s organicism also puts the third thesis, the view that perceptible objects are less real than the Forms, in a new light.   Since most philosophers see the picture of degrees of reality as absurd, Plato’s views are open to easy ridicule.   However, Plato’s organicism suggests that this objection is based on a confusion.     On this view, when Plato states or implies that some items are less real than others, he is arranging them in a hierarchy based on to the degree in which they measure up to a certain ideal of organic unity.  On this scale, a man has more “being” than a tomato because a man has a higher degree of organic unity than a tomato.    That has nothing to do with the absurd view that tomatoes do not exist or that they only exist to a lesser degree.   The view that Plato is committed to these absurd ideas derives from an equivocation of Plato’s notion of “being” (roughly organic unity) with the notion of existence denoted by the existential quantifier.

Rather than being either irrelevant to Plato’s philosophy or incompatible with it, Plato’s organicism provides new interpretations of certain concepts in those theories.   Indeed, it suggests that some of the standard criticisms of Plato’s views are based on equivocations.

4. Influence of Plato’s Cosmology

a. Transition to Aristotle’s Organicism

Although Plato’s organicism does seem to be consistent with a theory of Forms, it does not come without a price for that theory.  The theory of Forms had been posited to act as causes, as standards, and as objects of knowledge (Prior, 1985), and Plato’s organicism does undermine some of the original motivations for the theory of Forms.  For example, Plato’s argument that the Forms are needed as standards requires a depreciation of the perceptible world. If living organisms are not merely an image of perfection and beauty, but are themselves perfect and beautiful, then these can act as intelligible standards and there is no special need to posit another separate world of superior intelligible existence. Similar arguments can be extended to the view that Forms are needed as causes and as objects of knowledge.  If one enriches the perceptible world by populating it with intelligible entities, that is, living organisms possessed of their own internal idea, there is no need to look for intelligible standards, causes, or objects of knowledge, in a separate Platonic realm.  In that case, positing a world of separate Forms is an unnecessary metaphysical hypothesis.  This is precisely the direction taken by Aristotle.

Aristotle follows Plato in speaking of form and matter, but, unlike Plato, he does not separate the form from the perceptible objects. Aristotle holds that what is real are substances, roughly, individual packages of formed matter. However, not just any perceptible entity is a substance.  In the Metaphysics (1032a15-20), Aristotle states that “animals and plants and things of that kind” are substances “if anything is.”   On this view, part of the importance of the Timaeus is that it is intermediary between Plato’s orthodox theory of Forms and Aristotle’s theory substance (Johansen, 2004), a point which is lost if the Timaeus is dismissed as a mere literary work with no philosophical significance.  See Sellars (1967), Furth (1987), and McDonough (2000) for further discussions of Aristotle’s organicism.

b. Importance for Contemporary Philosophy


Since Plato’s organicist cosmology includes many plainly unbelievable views (Russell, 1945), the question arises why modern philosophers should take it seriously. Several important points of importance for contemporary philosophy have emerged.  First, Plato’s organicist cosmology is relevant to the interpretation of his theory of Forms by providing new interpretations of key terms in that pivotal theory, and it may even provide an escape from some of the standard objections of that theory (Sect. 4b). Second, Plato’s organicism is intimately linked to his notion of man as the microcosm, a view which appears again in Whitehead’s process philosophy, Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, and others. Third, Plato’s organicism illuminates his ethical views (Sect. 3.2). Fourth, since Plato conceives of the polis on analogy with an organism, it sheds light on his political philosophy (Sect. 3d). Fifth, Plato’s organicism illuminates his account of health and medicine (Sect. 3d), which, in turn, is the classical inspiration for modern holistic views of health and medicine. Sixth, the concept of an organism as, roughly, a sphere organized around a causal center, of which modern “central state materialism is a conceptual descendent,  traces, arguably, to Plato’s Timaeus (Sect. 2b).  Seventh, the Timaeus deserves to be recognized for its contribution to the history of emergentism, which has again become topical in the philosophy of mind (Sect. 2d). Eighth, Aristotle’s theory of substance bears certain conceptual and historical connections to Plato’s organicism (Sect. 4b).  To the degree that these views are important to contemporary philosophy, and history of philosophy, Plato’s organicism is important as well.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Aristotle. 1951.  Metaphysics. Trans. W.D. Ross. The Basic Works of Aristotle. Ed.Richard McKeon.  Pp. 689-933.
  • Aristotle.  1953. Generation of Animals. A.L. Peck, Trans. Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press & London, England: William Heinemann, Ltd.
  • Plato. 1968. Republic. Trans.,  Alan Bloom. New York and London: Basic Books.
  • Plato. 1969. Apology. Hugh Tredennick, Trans. Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp.3-26.
  • Plato.  1969.  Phaedo. Hugh Tredennick, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 40-98.
  • Plato.  1969.  Gorgias.  W.D. Woodhead, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 229-307.
  • Plato. 1969.   Protagoras.   W.K.C. Guthrie, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 308-352.
  • Plato.  1969.  Theaetetus.  F.M. Cornford, Trans. Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 957-1017.
  • Plato.  1969.  Sophist.  F.M. Cornford, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 845-919.
  • Plato.  1969.  Philebus.   R. Hackforth, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E.  Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 1086-1150.
  • Plato.   1969.   Timaeus.   Benjamin Jowett, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 1151-1211.
  • Plato.  1969.  Laws.  A.E. Taylor, Trans.  Collected Dialogues of Plato.  E. Hamilton and H. Cairns, Ed.  Princeton:  Princeton University Press. Pp. 1225-1516.
  • Plato.  1997.  Symposium.  Alexander Nehamas and Paul Woodruff, Trans.  Plato: Complete Works.  John Cooper, Ed.  Indianapolis/Cambridge: Hackett. Pp. 457-505.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Allen, Reginald E.  1966.  Introduction to Greek Philosophy: Thales to Aristotle.  Ed. Reginald E. Allen.  New York: The Free Press.  Pp. 1-23.
  • Alexander, S. I.  1920.  Space, Time, and Deity, 2 vols. London: Macmillan.
  • Bergson, Henri.  1983.  Creative Evolution.  A. Mitchell, Trans.  Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
  • Brandwood, Leonard.  1992.  “Stylometry and Chronology.”  The Cambridge Companion to Plato.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.  Pp. 90-120.
  • Brisson,  Luc, and Meyerstein, F. Walter.    1995.  Inventing the Universe: Plato's Timaeus, the Big Bang, and the Problem of Scientific Knowledge. Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Buchsbaum, Ralph.  1957.  Animals Without Backbones. Vol. I.  Middlesex, England: Penguin Books.
  • Burnet, John.  1971.  Early Greek Philosophy.   London: Adam and Charles Black.
  • Cairns, Huntington.  1961.  Introduction to The Collected Dialogues of Plato.  Princeton: Princeton University Press. Pp. xiii-xxv.
  • Cassirer, Ernst.  1979.  The Individual and the Cosmos in Renaissance Philosophy.  Trans. Mario Domandi.  Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press.
  • Cornford.  F.M.  1965.   From Religion to Philosophy:  A Study in the Origins of Western Speculation.  New York: Harper and Row.
  • Cornford.  F.M.  1966.  Plato’s Cosmology:  The Timaeus of Plato.  The Liberal Arts Press.
  • Cornford.  F.M.  1997.  Introduction to Plato:  Timaeus.  Indianapolis: Hackett.  Pp. ix-xv.
  • Carone, Gabriela Roxana.  2005.  Plato’s Cosmology and its Ethical Dimensions.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Clayton, Philip, and Davies, Paul., Ed’s.  2006.   The Re-Emergence of Emergence: The Emergentist Hypothesis from Science to Religion.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Furth, Montgomery.  1988.  Substance, Form, and Psyche: An Aristotelian Metaphysics.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hamilton, Edith.  1964.  The Greek Way.  New York: The W.W. Norton Co.
  • Heisenberg, Werner.  1958.  Physics and Philosophy.   London: George Allen and Unwin.
  • Johansen, Thomas Kjeller.  2004.  Plato’s Natural Philosophy: A Study of the Timaeus-Critias.   Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kim,  Jaegwon, Beckermann, Angsar, and Flores, Hans, Ed’s.  1992.  Emergence or Reduction? Berlin: De Gruyter.
  • Knowles, David.  1989.  Evolution of Medieval Thought.  United Kingdom: Longman.
  • Kraut, Richard.  1992.  “Introduction to the Study of Plato.”   The Cambridge Companion to Plato.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.  Pp. 1-50.
  • Leibniz, G.W.  1968.  “Principles of Nature and Grace."  Leibniz: Philosophical Writings.  Trans, Mary Morris.  New York: Dutton & London: Dent.  Pp. 21-31.
  • Lovejoy, A.O.  1964.  The Great Chain of Being.  Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • McDonough, Richard.  1991. “Plato’s not to Blame for Cognitive Science.”  Ancient Philosophy. Vol. 11.  1991.  Pp. 301-314.
  • McDonough, Richard.  2000.  "Aristotle's Critique of Functionalist Theories of  Mind."  Idealistic Studies.  Vol. 30.  No. 3.  pp. 209-232.
  • McDonough, Richard.  2002.  “Emergence and Creativity: Five Degrees of Freedom” (including a discussion with the editor).  In Creativity, Cognition and Knowledge.  Terry Dartnall, Ed.  London:  Praeger.  Pp. 283-320.
  • Meinwald, Constance C.  1992.  “Goodbye to the Third Man.”  The Cambridge Companion to Plato.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.  Pp. 365-396.
  • Morgan, Lloyd.  1923.  Emergent Evolution. London: Williams and Norgate, 1923.
  • Mourelatos,  A.  1986.  “Quality, Structure, and Emergence in Later Pre-Socratic Philosophy.”  Proceedings of the Boston Colloquium in Ancient Philosophy.  2,  Pp. 127-194.
  • Muirhead, John H.  1931.  The Platonic Tradition in Anglo-Saxon Philosophy.  New York: The Macmillan Company & London: George Allen & Unwin.
  • Naess, Arne.  1990.  Ecology, Community, Lifestyle: Outelines of an Ecosophy.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nagel, Ernst.  1979.  The Structure of Science.  Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Patterson, Richard.  1985.  Image and Reality in Plato’s Metaphysics.  Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Prior, William J.  1985.  The Unity and Development of Plato’s Metaphysics.  LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1981.  Reason, Truth, and History.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary.  1990.  Realism with a Human Face.  Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Robin, Leon.  1996.  Greek Thought and the Origins of the Scientific Spirit.  London and New York: Routledge.
  • Robinson, John Mansley.  1968.  An Introduction to Early Greek Philosophy.  Houghton Mifflin College Division.
  • Russell, Bertrand.  1945.  A History of Western Philosophy.  New York: Simon & Schuster.
  • Sallis, John.   1999.  Chorology:  On Beginning in Plato’s Timaeus.  Indianapolis: Indiana University Press.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid.  1967.  “Raw Materials, Subjects, and Substrata.”   Philosophical Perspectives.   Springfield, Illinois:  Charles C. Thomas, Publisher.  Pp. 137-152.
  • Taylor, A.E.  1928.  A Commentary on Plato’s Timaeus.  Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Vlastos, Gregory. 1975.  Plato’s Universe.  Seattle: University of Washington Press.
  • Whitehead, A. N.  1978.  Process and Reality (Corrected Edition).   New York: Macmillan and London: Collier Macmillan.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig.  1966.  Tractatus-logico-philosophicus.  Trans, D F. Pears and B. F. McGuiness.  New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul Ltd.
  • Wulf, Maurice De.  1956.  Scholastic Philosophy.   New York: Dover Publications.

Author Information

Richard McDonough
Arium Academy and James Cook University

Modal Illusions

We often talk about how things could have been, given different circumstances, or about how things might be in the future. When we speak this way, we presume that these situations are possible. However, sometimes people make mistakes regarding what is possible or regarding what could have been the case. When what seems possible to a person is not really possible, this person is subject to a modal illusion. With a modal illusion either (i) things seem like they could have been otherwise when they could not have been otherwise or (ii) things seem as if they could not have been otherwise when they could have been otherwise. The most widely discussed cases are instances of the former. Certain impossibilities seem (at least to some people) to be possible. Because of these illusions, there are certain necessary truths (truths which could not have been false) that are mistakenly thought to be contingent. Of particular concern to philosophers working on modal illusions are certain necessary truths that are known a posteriori, and which strike some people as contingent. The most discussed examples are found in Saul Kripke’s Naming and Necessity (1972), the work that sparked the contemporary interest in modal illusions.

While many elementary necessary truths seem to be necessary, the “necessary a posteriori” do not always seem to be so. For example, it is obviously a necessary truth that two is greater than one. It does not seem that things could have been otherwise. On the other hand, it is also a necessary truth that water is composed of H2O (as Kripke (1972) explains), but this might not seem to be necessary. The proposition expressed by the sentence ‘water is H2O’ strikes some people as contingently true because it seems that water could have been composed of something else. However, water could not have been composed of anything other than H2O since that’s what water is. Anything else would not be water. We came to know the composition of water through experience and so one might think that we could have had different experiences that would have shown that water was composed of XYZ, for example, and not H2O. However, the idea that things could have been otherwise and that the proposition is merely contingently false is a modal illusion.

Table of Contents

  1. Modal Illusions
  2. The Necessary A Priori
  3. Ramifications
  4. Similarity Accounts
  5. Objections
    1. True Modal Beliefs and False Non-Modal Beliefs
    2. Other Examples of Modal Illusions
  6. Two-Dimensionalist Accounts
  7. Objections
    1. Other Examples of Modal Illusions
    2. The Epistemic Status of the Secondary Proposition
    3. Believing Impossibilities
  8. Possibility Accounts
  9. Objections
    1. Conceivability and Possibility
    2. Impossible Worlds
    3. Metaphysical Possibility
  10. References and Further Reading

1. Modal Illusions

Unless otherwise specified, the terms ‘necessary,’ ‘contingent,’ ‘possible,’ ‘impossible,’ and all of their cognates refer to metaphysical notions. The phrases ‘could have been,’ ‘could not have been,’ and so forth are also used in a metaphysical sense. If p is necessarily true, then p could not have been false. If p is necessarily false, then p could not have been true.  The propositions expressed by the sentence ‘2 is greater than 1’ is necessarily true since it could not have been false, for example. If p is contingently true, then although p is true, it could have been false. For example, the proposition expressed by the sentence, ‘John McCain lost the 2008 U.S. Presidential election,’ is contingently true since it could have been false. McCain could have won the 2008 election. If p is possible, then either p is true or p is contingently false. The proposition expressed by the sentence ‘McCain won the 2008 election’ is false, but it is possible that McCain could have won the 2008 election.

Certainly, a person can be mistaken about the modal properties of many different types of statements or propositions. A person might mistakenly believe that a contingent truth known a priori is necessarily true. Kripke (1972) gives examples of the “contingent a priori that may also be illusory. Consider Kripke’s example, ‘stick S is one meter,’ said of the stick used to fix the reference of ‘one meter.’ Kripke points out that ‘stick S is one meter’ is contingent because stick S could have been a different length; it could have been longer or shorter than one meter. Yet, the speaker knows that stick S is one meter a priori because stick S is being used to fix the referent of ‘one meter.’ Before one knows how long the stick actually is, one knows that it is one meter long. It strikes some people as false that stick S could have been longer or shorter than one meter since stick S is fixing the reference of ‘one meter.’ Stick S could have been many lengths, but it could not have been longer than or shorter than one meter since ‘one meter’ refers to whatever length stick S happens to be. Those who are struck by the appearance that stick S could not have been longer or shorter than one meter, are subject to a modal illusion. (However, this does not seem to be a common mistake made regarding Kripke’s examples of the “contingent a priori”. Rather, it seems that when a person doubts the Kripkean examples of the “contingent a priori, the person believes that these truths are knowable a posteriori. One might argue that while it is necessary that stick S is one meter, one could only have known that through experience.)

There may also be “contingent a posteriori truths that are thought to be necessary. For example, Kripke (1972, p. 139) points out that it is sometimes mistakenly thought that light could not have existed without being seen as light. “The fact that we identify light in a certain way seems to us to be crucial even though it is not necessary; the intimate connection may create an illusion of necessity.” It is merely contingently true that light is seen as light, but some might think it is necessarily true and that things could not have been otherwise.

Finally, there are certainly necessary a priori truths that strike some people as merely contingently true. Any mistake about what could have been the case or could not have been the case is a modal illusion. However, the most commonly discussed examples of modal illusions are Kripke’s examples of the “necessary a posteriori and therefore, these will be the focus of this entry. Sections 3 through 8 below provide an overview of the most prominent explanations offered by contemporary philosophers regarding how or why a person subject to a modal illusion of the necessary a posteriori comes to make the mistake.

2. The Necessary A Priori

The following are the three most commonly discussed examples of modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori”:

(a) Hesperus is Phosphorus.

(b) Water is H2O.

(c) This table is made of wood. (Said of a table originally made of wood.)

The examples above do strike many people as contingent on first consideration. However, the propositions expressed by each of the above sentences are necessary. For example, ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is both necessary and knowable a posteriori. Given that Hesperus is Phosphorus, Hesperus is necessarily Phosphorus since being self-identical is a necessary property (Any object is necessarily identical to itself.) Yet, we came to know that Hesperus is Phosphorus through empirical means. The proposition expressed by the sentence might seem contingent to someone if that person thought that Hesperus could have been distinct from Phosphorus. (b) and (c) are also necessary since composition is a necessary property of an object or substance. But of course, we need empirical evidence to know the composition of water or this table and so both (b) and (c) are a posteriori.

Although (a), (b), and (c) are necessary truths, the following propositions are necessarily false, but may seem to some people to be merely contingently false to some people:

(a1) Hesperus is distinct from Phosphorus.

(b1) Water is XYZ.

(c1) This table is made of ice. (Said of a table originally made of wood.)

It might seem that Hesperus could have been distinct from Phosphorus, that water could have been composed of XYZ, or that this table could have been made of ice. A person might consider this table, think about what it could have been made of and come to the mistaken conclusion that it could have been made of ice and then conclude that the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘this table is made of ice’ is merely contingently false. But of course, this table could not have been made of ice. Given that this table is made of wood, it is necessarily made of wood. Any table made of ice would not be this same table.

Of course, some philosophers deny that these examples are necessary. In that case, there is no modal illusion to explain since what seems contingent is contingent and what seems possible is possible. However, each of the accounts considered below all attempt to explain the illusion in these cases because each of them accepts the Kripkean conclusions about the necessary nature of the above examples.

3. Ramifications

The correct solution to the problem of modal illusions will have an important impact on many philosophical issues because it is common for philosophical arguments to rely upon thought experiments about what is and is not possible.  For example, in the philosophy of mind, some say that they can conceive of mental activity without any physical activity or of a mental entity existing in the absence of a physical entity. Indeed, this was part of Descartes’ argument. Descartes relied on the seeming possibility that his mind or soul could exist without his body. Descartes’ narrator claimed that he could imagine being deceived about having a body, but he could not imagine being deceived about being a thinking being. So it seems that the mind or soul could exist or could have existed without the body. If this is true, then physicalism must be false.

The possibility of a philosophical zombie is often used in arguments against a physical reduction of consciousness. Some people believe that philosophical zombies could have existed. One might imagine a being completely identical in every respect to a human being, however this being is not conscious; there is no mental activity whatsoever. There are no emotions, thoughts, beliefs, fears, desires and so forth even though there are all the corresponding neurological events happening in the body. Moreover, the zombie exhibits all the behaviors of a person with emotions, thoughts, beliefs, fears, desires and so forth. For example, it acts angry when there are the neurological firings in the brain that normally occur when a person experiences anger. However, the zombie does not feel anger; the zombie does not feel anything! If these sorts of creatures could have existed, then mental activity does not supervene on physical activity. All the physical facts would be the same as they actually are but there would be no mental facts.

Another example many dualists use is that many people are struck by the feeling that pain could exist or could have existed without the corresponding physical activity in the body. Some say that they can imagine pain, the sensation, without the correlated neurological, physical activity in the body that occurs whenever a person has pain (call that C-Fiber stimulation). If this represents a genuine metaphysical possibility, then pain and other conscious events are not identical with, or reducible to, physical events.

Dualists use the sort of reasoning in these examples to show that there is no necessary connection between the mental and the physical, as  perhaps these are modal illusions. Perhaps zombie worlds, body-less souls, and pain in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation are not really possible. It may be the case that although a philosophical zombie seems possible it is not possible, just as it is the case XYZ-water seems possible, even though it is not possible. In responding to arguments that rely on these appearances of possibility, many physicalists point to the Kripkean examples of the “necessary a posteriori”, arguing that these examples strike many people as contingent even though they are necessary. So even if it is necessary that mental events are physical events and even if it is true that mental events could not have existed without the corresponding physical events, it might seem as though they could have, just as it might seem as though water could have existed without being H2O even though it could not have.

Depending on the correct account of modal illusions, the seeming possibilities of philosophical zombies and of a purely mental world may or may not count as modal illusions. Different explanations of modal illusions have different consequences for the materialist/dualist debate because only some explanations of modal illusions will count zombie worlds and body-less souls as modal illusions.

4. Similarity Accounts

Some explanations of what modal illusions are contend that the person who is struck by the feeling that things could have been otherwise does not really have an impossible situation in mind. Instead, the situation the person considers is one in which there are similar objects or a similar substance and the situation has been redescribed. This family of accounts, called Similarity Accounts, includes Kripke’s own. According to Kripke, it might seem possible that this (wooden) table could have been made of ice because we claim that we can imagine this table being made of ice. However, Kripke (1972, p. 114) says, “this is not to imagine this table as made of…ice, but to…imagine another table, resembling this one in all the external details made of…ice.” According to Kripke, the intuition that leads a person to conclude that this table could have been made of ice is not an intuition about this table but an intuition about a similar one. The intuition must be redescribed.

Kripke (1972, p. 142) also argues that the necessarily false propositions ((a1), (b1), and (c1)) could not have been true but some “appropriate corresponding qualitative statement” for each is true. Kripke (1972, p. 143) claims that the sentence, ‘two distinct bodies might have occupied in the morning and the evening, respectively, the very positions actually occupied by Hesperus-Phosphorus-Venus’ is true and should replace the “inaccurate statement that Hesperus might have turned out not to be Phosphorus”. It is unclear whether Kripke wants to maintain that the person subject to the modal illusion really has that corresponding statement in mind or whether he simply wants to maintain that this corresponding statement should replace the false statement the person does have in mind. In either case, Kripke adopts a Similarity Account approach in saying that the person has the false belief because she considers a situation in which some planet similar to Hesperus is distinct from some planet similar to Phosphorus – and not a situation in which Hesperus is not Phosphorus. Similarity Accounts argue that if Hesperus could not have been distinct from Phosphorus, then when a person claims to believe that they could have been distinct, it cannot be because she has imagined a scenario or situation in which they are distinct since there is no such possible scenario or situation.

Kripke goes on to ague that there is no similar explanation about the belief that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation. One can imagine that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation; there is no redescription necessary because there is no other feeling that is very much like pain that the person imagines. To be a pain is to be felt as a pain, according to Kripke, and so if we imagine the sensation of pain without C-Fiber stimulation, the sensation we imagine must be pain – otherwise, wha would the similar phenomenon be if not pain?

The appearance of pain without C-Fiber stimulation is not like the appearance of water without hydrogen and oxygen, according to Kripke. It is not true that to be water is to be experienced as water. A person can have all the experiences of water and yet the substance could be something else. When one imagines water composed of XYZ, according to these accounts, the person has imagined this similar substance – one that is experienced as water but is not water. However, when one imagines pain existing in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation, there is no phenomenon similar to pain that the person really imagines. One cannot have all the experiences of pain without there being pain. So Similarity Accounts are unable to explain the false intuition that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation because this intuition is not false and so not a modal illusion.

5. Objections

a. True Modal Beliefs and False Non-Modal Beliefs

According to Similarity Accounts, the reason a person believes that something impossible could have been the case is because she imagines a situation that could have been the case for some similar objects or substances. It might seem that water could have been composed of XYZ because a person might imagine some substance very similar to water in all qualitative respects, but this substance will not really be water.

Consider a true modal belief, such as the belief that John McCain could have won the 2008 U.S. Presidential election. Normally, we would say that this is a belief regarding John McCain himself and not someone similar to John McCain in the relevant respects. Indeed, this is what Kripke wants to hold about true modal beliefs. Kripke (1972, p. 44) writes, “When you ask whether it is necessary or contingent that Nixon won the election, you are asking the intuitive question whether in some counterfactual situation this man would in fact have lost the election.” He adamantly opposes the idea that the intuition is about some man similar to Nixon, yet he claims that the intuition that this (wooden) table might have been made of ice is not about this table. There may be a reason to explain true and false modal intuitions in this non-uniform way, but without an argument, we have no reason to claim that our false modal intuitions are about objects similar to the objects we claim they are about while our true modal intuitions are about the very objects we claim they are about.

Such a theory is also non-uniform in how it would be extended to treat false non-modal beliefs.  The belief that New York City is the capital of New York State is a false non-modal belief. (It is a false belief, yet the belief is not at all about what could have been the case.) If a Similarity Account were extended to explain how or why a person has false beliefs more generally, the account would say that the person comes to this belief because he has an intuition that some city, similar to New York City in the relevant respects, is the capital of New York State. This is clearly an implausible explanation of such a false belief. We have no reason to believe that our common false beliefs stem from true beliefs about similar objects.

Now consider a necessary falsehood that a person mistakenly believes is true. Any mathematical falsehood would count. The mathematical falsehood that 18 squared is 314 (it is actually 324) is necessarily false; it could not have been true, but someone might mistakenly believe it is true. If a Similarity Account were extended to treat false beliefs more generally, the account would say that the person who believes that 18 squared is 314 does not really have 18 in mind but some number similar to 18 in the relevant respects. This is what the theory would say to explain any false mathematical beliefs. Because many (if not all) Similarity Accounts argue that one can never imagine impossibilities (which is Barcan Marcus’ claim in “Rationality and Believing the Impossible” (1983)), then no one could ever believe that a mathematical falsehood either could have been true or even is true. But clearly, we are capable of believing mathematical falsehoods.

b. Other Examples of Modal Illusions

In many occurrences of modal illusions, a person will come to realize that the proposition expressed by the sentence is necessary and will still be struck by the feeling that things could have been otherwise. As Alex Byrne (2007, p. 13) says, “A modal illusion, properly so-called, would require the appearance that p is possible in the presence of the conviction that p is impossible.” For example, a person who has read Kripke many times and acknowledges that water is necessarily H2O may still be struck by the appearance that water could have been XYZ. Call this a “person in the know.” A Similarity Account cannot explain the modal illusion in these cases. The subject in the know at once believes that water is necessarily composed of H2O and is struck by the feeling that things could have been otherwise. A Similarity Account would say that the intuition is that some other substance, similar to water in the relevant respects. The sentence ‘water could have been XYZ’ needs to be replaced.

Our subject in the know might say, “I know that it is impossible that p but it still sure seems like p could have been the case.” A Similarity Account might argue that what our subject really means is that “I know that it is impossible that p* but it still sure seems like p* could have been the case.” In that case, the account would need to explain why it is p* she has in mind in both instances. But more importantly, the account would need to explain this new illusion: if p* is possible and it strikes her as possible, why does she claim to know that it is impossible that p*? p* is possible and so according to this type of explanation, she must have a different proposition in mind. Might that be p**?

Similarity Accounts also cannot explain the illusion that this very table could have been made of ice. Imagine a person points to a wooden table and claims, “this very table is made of wood, but it could have been made of ice.” The person cannot be more specific about which table he means to consider; it is this very one in front of him, one that is made of wood. It would be absurd to say that the person is considering some other similar table that is made of ice. Our subject has said that the table he means to consider is made of wood. He could even have said, “It seems to me that any wooden table could have been made of ice.” Similarity Accounts fail to explain this illusion as well. It cannot be that our subject means to consider a specific table but mistakenly considers some similar one. He is making the claim about any wooden table, whatsoever. What is he considering in this case if the Similarity Account is correct?

6. Two-Dimensionalist Accounts

Another type of account that seeks to explain how modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori” arise makes use of the two-dimensional semantic framework proposed by philosophers such as David Chalmers and Frank Jackson. This sort of approach aims to explain how a person might mistakenly think that a necessary proposition is contingent. As opposed to a traditional view of reference, the two-dimensional semantic framework proposes that there are two intensions of certain words. According to one common view of reference, a concept determines a function from possible worlds to referents. The function is an “intension” and it determines the “extension”. Two-Dimensionalism proposes that sometimes there are two intensions because often there is no single intension that can do all the work a meaning needs to do.

For example, Chalmers and Jackson explain that ‘water’ has two intensions. Under the common view of reference, the concept “water” determines a function from possible worlds to water/H2O. The function is an intension and determines that the extension of ‘water’ is always water/ H2O. But according to the two-dimensional framework, there are two different intensions, two different functions from possible worlds to extensions. While the secondary intension of ‘water’ always picks out water/ H2O, the primary intension picks out the “watery stuff” of a world – the clear, drinkable, liquid that fills the lakes, rivers, and oceans in a possible world. In certain possible worlds, that stuff is composed of XYZ and so it might seem as if the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘water is XYZ’ is merely contingently false. That is an illusion caused by conflating the primary and secondary intensions of ‘water.’ The primary intension is meant to capture the “cognitive significance” of the term, which is what a person subject to a modal illusion must have in mind.

Certain sentences thus express two different propositions depending on the two different intensions of the terms in the sentence. According to Two-Dimensionalists, the primary proposition determines the epistemic property of the sentence (whether it is a priori or a posteriori) while the secondary proposition determines the modal property of the sentence (whether it is necessary or contingent). With any example of the Kripkean “necessary a posteriori”, the primary proposition is a posteriori but not necessary, while the secondary proposition is necessary but not a posteriori. The secondary proposition in this case, that water is H2O, is necessary in the standard Kripkean sense, but it is not a posteriori because the secondary intension always picks out H2O in any possible world; we do not need to do empirical investigation to know that water is water.  The primary proposition is not necessary since the watery stuff of a world could be composed of H2O, XYZ, or something else. However, it is a posteriori. We need empirical evidence to know what water is composed of in any world.

Jackson (1997, p.76) holds that the secondary proposition is “normally meant by unadorned uses of the phrase ‘proposition expressed by a sentence’” and Chalmers (1996, p. 64) too says that the secondary proposition “is more commonly seen as the proposition expressed by a statement.” Therefore, one might say that the proposition expressed by ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is necessary. If it seems contingent to a person, that is a modal illusion and the illusion is explained by the fact that the primary proposition is not necessary. According to this sort of account, when a person is subject to a modal illusion and concludes that a necessary truth is contingent, she does not consider the proposition expressed. Rather, the sentence misdescribes the situation she is considering. Her mistake is not simply in concluding that the proposition is contingent but in reporting what proposition she is considering. Two-Dimensionalist Accounts have this feature in common with Similarity Accounts: the person subject to the modal illusion does not have some impossible situation in mind. The situation she has in mind is not described correctly.

Chalmers uses his Two-Dimensionalist explanation of modal illusions to argue for dualism. According to Chalmers, pain in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation is not a modal illusion. In The Conscious Mind, Chalmers (1996, p. 133) says, “with consciousness, the primary and secondary intensions coincide.” The primary intension of ‘pain’ picks out painful sensations, feelings experienced as pain, but the secondary intension of ‘pain’ also picks out painful sensations, feelings experienced as pain, since what it means to be a pain is to be experienced as a pain. It does not always pick out C-Fiber stimulation. So, painy-stuff cannot be misdescribed by the word ‘pain’ since all that it is to be a pain is to be felt as a pain. The secondary proposition – the proposition that backs the necessity or contingency of a sentence – expressed by ‘pain is C-Fiber stimulation’ is contingent. The proposition could have been false since the secondary intension of ‘pain’ picks out something other than C-Fiber stimulation in some possible worlds. The person who believes that the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘pain is C-Fiber stimulation’ is contingently true has not made a mistake.

While Jackson once used his account of modal illusions to defend a dualist theory, he now supports physicalism. Given his physicalist commitments, Jackson should hold that a person who is struck by the feeling that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation is under a modal illusion. Given his Two-Dimensionalist commitments, however, it is hard to know what he would say to explain the illusion. A Two-Dimensionalist Account of the illusion that pain could have existed in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation should say that the person who believes this imagines a situation in which the primary intension of ‘pain’ picks out something just like pain, but is not pain. It is unclear how a Two-Dimensionalist could make this sort of approach work since, as Chalmers (1996, p. 133) and Kripke (1972, p. 151) have noted, ‘pain’ always picks out pain and not painy-stuff. There is no painy-stuff that is not pain.  But perhaps what Jackson wants to argue is that while we believe we are imagining a world in which there is pain and no C-Fiber stimulation, there really must be C-Fiber stimulation in that situation.

7. Objections

a. Other Examples of Modal Illusions

Consider again the person in the know who is subject to a modal illusion. Two-Dimensionalist accounts fail to explain the illusion in these cases. Chalmers argues that it might seem as if the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘water is XYZ’ is contingently false because the sentence is used to express something true in some possible worlds. Chalmers (2007, p. 67) says that the person subject to the modal illusion considers “a conceivable situation – a small part of a world” in which watery stuff (and not water) is XYZ but the subject misdescribes the situation she is considering using the term ‘water.’ According to Chalmers (1996, p. 367, footnote 32), there is a “gap between what one finds conceivable at first glance and what is really conceivable.” It might seem conceivable that water could have been XYZ, but it is not really conceivable since it is impossible. While this may be a plausible explanation in the typical cases of modal illusions, it is an implausible explanation for what happens in the case of our subject in the know. This person knows enough to recognize that there might be a situation in which the watery stuff at a world is composed of XYZ and thus makes the primary proposition expressed by the sentence ‘water is XYZ’ true, but she does not have that proposition or situation in mind. Rather, it strikes her as possible – even though she believes it is not possible – that water could have been XYZ and that the proposition expressed (the secondary proposition) is contingently false. The person in the know would explicitly consider the secondary proposition and it might still strike her as merely contingently false.

The Two-Dimensionalist explanations also fail to explain modal illusions involving ‘This table is made of wood’ or other sentences that use demonstratives. Imagine our subject is asked whether it seems that this table could have been made of ice and a certain wooden table is pointed to. If it strikes our subject as possible, she is subject to a modal illusion. Given that the table is made of wood, it could not have been made of anything else. According to a Two-Dimensionalist explanation of modal illusions, the reason it might seem as if this table could have been made of ice is that our subject has imagined a scenario in which the primary proposition expressed by the sentence ‘this table is made of ice’ is true. It is unclear what scenario or possible world would verify the sentence. If there is one table referred to when our interrogator uses the phrase ‘this table’ and points to a specific table, what might the primary intention of ‘this table’ pick out if not this very one?

Nathan Salmon (2005, p. 234) argues that in using the demonstrative and ostensively referring to the table, “I make no reference – explicit or implicit, literal or metaphorical, direct or allusive – to any … table other than the one I am pointing to.” There is no similar table our subject is asked to consider. It is stipulated when she is asked whether it seems that this very table could have been made of ice that she is to consider this very table. When asked to imagine this very table being made of ice, either one can or one cannot. If one can, the object of belief is this very table and one is subject to a modal illusion. If one comes to the conclusion that this table could have been made of ice, one has come to a conclusion about this very table. It is an incorrect conclusion, but that doesn’t mean that it wasn’t this table the person considered when reasoning to this mistaken conclusion.

Finally, consider another less discussed example of the “necessary a posteriori”. Kripke (1972) argues that every person necessarily has the parents that he or she has. Still, it seems to many people as if other people could have been their parents. If it seems to a person that she could have had different parents, that person must be subject to a modal illusion. According to Two-Dimensionalist Accounts, the reason a person makes this mistake is because she imagines a possible world in which someone very much like herself has parents other than the ones she actually has. If our subject, for example believes that ‘I am the daughter of the Queen of England,’ is merely contingently false, it is because she considers a world that would verify the primary proposition. The primary proposition, ostensibly, is true in some possible worlds, worlds in which someone very much like the speaker is the daughter of the Queen of England.

It seems very unlikely that a person would mean to imagine a world in which she is the daughter of the Queen of England and instead imagines a world in which someone just like her is the daughter of the Queen of England. It seems strange that any one would mistakenly and unknowingly use the word ‘I’ to refer to someone other than himself or herself. Furthermore, Chalmers (2006) argues that what makes the primary proposition true in certain possible worlds is not that the speakers of that world use the terms in a certain way. The way they use the terms are irrelevant. We are concerned with how we use the terms and what those terms would pick out in other possible worlds. So in this case, it is not because there is some doppelganger of our subject who uses ‘I’ to refer to herself that the sentence ‘I am the daughter of the Queen of England’ is true. It is a matter of how our subject uses the term and what the word ‘I’ would pick out in this other possible world. But given that our subject could not have been the daughter of the Queen of England (since she is not), it is unclear to whom ‘I’ refers in this possible world if not the subject herself.

b. The Epistemic Status of the Secondary Proposition

Chalmers (1996) explains that the “necessary a posteriori” express two propositions; one is necessary and the other is a posteriori but not necessary. Chalmers (1996, p. 64) claims that a statement is necessarily true in the first (a priori) sense if the associated primary proposition holds in all centered possible worlds (that is, if the statement would turn out to express a truth in any context of utterance). A statement is necessarily true in the a posteriori sense if the associated secondary proposition holds in all possible worlds (that is, if the statement as uttered in the actual world is true in all counterfactual worlds).

A statement such as ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus,’ for example, is not necessary in the first, a priori, sense because the primary proposition does not hold in all possible worlds – it does not express a truth in any context of utterance. However, it is necessary in the secondary sense since the secondary proposition holds in all possible worlds. The statement, as uttered in the actual world, is true in all counterfactual worlds. This is because the secondary proposition expresses something like “Venus-Hesperus-Phosphorus is Venus-Hesperus-Phosphorus.” Chalmers says that that this secondary proposition is not a posteriori, however. The primary proposition is a posteriori but not necessary, while the secondary proposition is necessary but not a posteriori. If it is not a posteriori, it would be either a priori or not knowable. This example seems to perhaps be a priori since it would not take any empirical investigation to know that Venus is Venus and certainly, this is fact that we can know.

But consider a statement such as ‘water is H2O.’ This statement is necessary in the secondary sense          because the secondary proposition holds in all possible worlds. The statement, as uttered in the actual world, is true in all counterfactual worlds since the secondary intension of ‘water’ always picks out H2O. But the secondary proposition is not a posteriori. Then it is either a priori or it is not knowable at all. Since we of course can know that water is H2O, it must be knowable a priori, but it is unclear how in the world a person could know the composition of water without empirical evidence.

The objection can also be made using ‘This table is made of wood.’ The secondary proposition expressed by this sentence (said of a table actually originally made of wood) is necessary in the secondary sense because the sentence, as uttered in this world, is true in all counterfactual worlds. But again, the secondary proposition is not both necessary and a posteriori. Either it is not knowable at all or else it is knowable a priori. Since we can of course know that this table is made of wood, that must be something we can know a priori, but it is even more implausible that we can know that fact a priori than it is plausible that we can know the composition of water a priori. How could we know what any table is made of without empirical evidence?

Yet Two-Dimensionalist Accounts rely on this idea to explain modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori”. It is because one proposition is a posteriori and not necessary while the other proposition is necessary and not a posteriori that we make these modal mistakes. The proposition expressed (the necessary one) may seem contingent because the primary proposition is not necessary and because the primary proposition is not knowable a priori, one might imagine that it could have been false since one can imagine a possible world in which it is false. But if the secondary proposition is not a priori either, then we have no need to posit a primary proposition to explain the illusion.

c. Believing Impossibilities

Finally, Two-Dimensionalist Accounts assume that a person cannot imagine impossibilities, but it seems quite plausible that we can and often do imagine or believe impossibilities. We believe mathematical falsehoods, for example, which are surely impossible. Two-Dimensionalists maintain that the scenario imagined has been misdescribed and it is not an impossible scenario that the person believes to be possible.  But if a person can believe that the mathematically impossible is possible, it is a natural extension to say that a person can believe other impossibilities are possible, including metaphysical impossible scenarios such as that water could have been XYZ.

Chalmers (1996, p. 97) recognizes that some mathematical falsehoods are conceivable in a sense; both Goldbach’s Conjecture and its negation are conceivable “in some sense” but “the false member of the pair will not qualify as conceivable” in Chalmers’ usage since there is no scenario that verifies the false member of the pair. Call Goldbach’s Conjecture g and its negation ¬g. When a person claims to believe ¬g, assuming g is true, the belief must be misdescribed. Chalmers (1996, p. 67) says that although one might claim to believe that Goldbach’s Conjecture is false, he is only “conceiving of a world where mathematicians announce it to be so; but if in fact Goldbach’s Conjecture is true, then one is misdescribing this world; it is really a world in which the Conjecture is true and some mathematicians make a mistake.” This might be a plausible explanation of what is going on in the Goldbach case since, at this time, we do not know which is true and which is false, but consider any very complicated mathematical proposition that is known to be true. If someone claims to believe it is false, Chalmers would have to argue that the person has misdescribed the world imagined. This is clearly not the case in most occurrences of false mathematical beliefs. The mathematician who has erred does not imagine a situation in which the complicated mathematical proposition is “announced” to be false; he believes it is false. Two-Dimensionalist Accounts cannot explain these common mathematical false beliefs.

8. Possibility Accounts

Rather than invoking a substitute object of thought and saying that there is only one sense of ‘possibility’ relevant to the discussion, another approach to modal illusions would be to maintain that there is only one object of thought under consideration but different senses of ‘possibility’ are in play. One way to do this is to hold that it is possible that water is XYZ, for example, in some non-metaphysical sense. Such Possibility Accounts deny the assumptions made by Similarity Accounts and Two-Dimensionalist accounts that one cannot believe the impossible and that when one claims to believe the impossible, one has misdescribed or redescribed one’s belief. Possibility Accounts argue that the person does have in mind some impossible world, or at least some impossible situation, and mistakenly believes that it is possible or could have obtained. The reason the impossible situation might seem possible is because it is possible in some other sense.

There are many occurrences of modal illusions in which there is no similar substance or object that can serve as the object of thought and explain the illusion. Possibility Accounts deny that the false modal intuition is about some other object or substance and instead claim that the belief is about a metaphysically impossible situation and that the reason it strikes many people as possible is that it is possible in an epistemic sense. Of course there are many definitions of ‘epistemic possibility.’ According to some theorists, p is epistemically possible if p is true for all one knows. According to others, p is epistemically possible if p is not known to be false. And according to others, p is epistemically possible if p cannot be known to be false a priori. It is some version of this last definition that many theorists rely on to explain modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori” using a Possibility Account. Since all of the examples discussed here are necessary and a posteriori, they cannot be known to be false a priori.  Therefore, each example is epistemically possible. Since each example is epistemically possible, it might seem to a person that things could have been otherwise even though things could not have been otherwise. The appearance of metaphysical possibility is explained by the epistemic possibility.

This type of account claims that a person subject to a modal illusion can – and usually does – have a metaphysical impossibility in mind, but it also claims that when the person believes the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘Hesperus is distinct from Phosphorus’ is contingently false, the proposition the person thinks is contingently false is the proposition expressed by the sentence and not some other. It is not that she believes that the sentence could have expressed something else and thus could have been true. Rather, she believes of the proposition expressed that it could have been true.

Possibility Accounts are thought to be able to explain those modal illusions that the other two types of accounts cannot explain. For example, when the person in the know says, “I know that it is impossible that p but it still sure seems like p could have been the case,” the Possibility Account argues that the subject can at once know that p is (metaphysically) impossible and be struck by the feeling that p is possible if p is possible in some other sense. Consider, too, the failed attempts to explain the modal illusion that this very table could have been made of ice. If this table could have been made of ice in some other sense, then the reason one might think that it could have been made of ice (in a metaphysical sense) is clear. Possibility accounts then must be able to explain how these impossibilities are possible in some other sense.

Stephen Yablo, a prominent defender of Possibility Accounts of modal illusions, claims that while water could not have been XYZ in a metaphysical sense, water could have been XYZ in a “conceptual” sense: if p is conceptually possible, then p could have turned out to be the case. Yablo explains that if p is metaphysically possible then p could have turned out to have been the case. There are certain propositions that while metaphysically impossible are conceptually possible. Such a proposition p could not have turned out to have been the case even though it could have turned out to be the case. This explains modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori”. All of the examples so far considered are conceptually possible even though they are metaphysically impossible. (a1), (b1), and (c1) could have turned out to be so.

Yablo insists that conceptually possibility should not be reduced to the a priori, but without reducing it, ‘conceptual possibility’ could be cashed out in any number of ways. For instance, consider again Goldbach’s Conjecture. In some sense, either g or ¬g “could turn out to be the case” since we don’t know which is true. But in another sense, only g or ¬g could turn out to be the case since, if g is false, it is not only necessarily false, but logically impossible. Even though we don’t know right now whether g or ¬g is true, only one could turn out to be true in a certain sense. It is not clear whether or not something such as Goldbach’s conjecture could turn out to be true.

On the other hand, Yablo (1993, pp. 29-30) argues that it is conceptually possible that “there should be a town whose resident barber shaved all and only the town’s non-shavers.” This means that it could have turned out to be the case that there is a town whose resident barber shaves all and only the town’s non-shavers. However, it certainly could not have turned out to be the case that there is a town whose resident barber shaves all and only the non-shavers. The example is different than Goldbach’s conjecture. In that case, the necessary falsehood is unknown, so in some sense, the necessary falsehood could turn out to be the case. In the barber case, however, we know that the proposition is false, so it could not turn out to be true. And if it could not turn out to be the case, then such a town is not conceptually possible, contrary to Yablo’s claims.

Other Possibility Accounts avoid this problem by defining ‘epistemic possibility’ or ‘conceptual possibility’ in another way. For example, Scott Soames says that p is epistemically possible if and only if p is a way the world could conceivably be and that p is a way the world could conceivably be if we need evidence to rule out that it is the way the world is. For example, it is epistemically possible that water is XYZ because it is conceivable that the world is such that water is composed of XYZ. We do need evidence to rule out that this is the way the world is because we need evidence to know the composition of water. For all instances of the “necessary a posteriori”, one does need evidence to rule out metaphysical impossibilities that are epistemically possible. On the other hand, one does not need evidence to rule out that the world is such that there is a town whose resident barber shaves all and only the town’s non-shavers. This is not epistemically possible and not an example of the “necessary a posteriori”.

According to the schema Soames offers to identify instances of the “necessary a posteriori”, (a) is not an example of the “necessary a posteriori”. Soames argues that the proposition expressed by the sentence ‘Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is necessary, but it is not a posteriori since the proposition expressed is something like “Venus is Venus.” Clearly we do not need empirical evidence to know that is true and we do not need empirical evidence to rule out that the world is such that Venus is not Venus (or that Hesperus is not Phosphorus). If we do not need evidence to rule out that this is the way the world is, then it is not epistemically possible.

The problem with Soames’ account is that we did need evidence to know that Hesperus is Phosphorus. The ancients who made this discovery did not do it from the armchair; they needed empirical evidence. Soames (forthcoming, p. 16) claims that “the function of empirical evidence needed for knowledge that Hesperus is Phosphorus is not to rule out possible world-states in which the proposition is false…evidence is needed to rule out possible states in which we use the sentence … to express something false.” The ancients though did not need empirical evidence to rule out worlds in which the sentence is used to express something false. They needed evidence to know that Hesperus and Phosphorus were the same.

Furthermore, it seems that Soames could argue similarly regarding the other two example: Soames could say that we did not need evidence to rule out a possible world-state in which the proposition that water is H2O is false, but we needed evidence to rule out possible states in which we use the sentence ‘water is H2O’ to express something false. This is similar to what the Two-Dimensionalists argue, although Soames gives rather forceful and convincing arguments against Two-Dimensionalism himself. He does not adopt this strategy for either of the other two examples. Although Soames’ general explanation is promising, it is a problem that he rejects the explanation for one important example of modal illusions of the “necessary a posteriori”.

A Possibility Account might say that a philosophical zombie is epistemically possible but not metaphysically possible or that pain in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation is epistemically possible but not metaphysically possible. This is a common position taken by those who adopt a Possibility account. Chalmers (1996, p. 137) explains: “On this position, “zombie worlds” may correctly describe the world that we are conceiving, even according to secondary intensions. It is just that the world is not metaphysically possible.” Chalmers (1996, p. 131) claims that this is “by far the most common strategy used by materialists” and recognizes Bigelow and Pargetter (1990) and Byrne (1993) among that camp.

However, not all Possibility Accounts defend this view in the way Chalmers describes. According to some Possibility Accounts, the reason the examples of the “necessary a posteriori” strike some people as contingent is because one cannot know that their negations are false a priori. Because we cannot know that the propositions expressed by the sentences ‘philosophical zombies exist’ and ‘pain is not C-Fiber stimulation’ are false a priori, these are epistemic possibilities. Since they are epistemically possible, it might seem to some people that they are metaphysically possible even if they are not – even if physicalism is true.

On the other hand, one could adopt a Possibility Account and deny physicalism. In that case, one could allow that philosophical zombies and pain in the absence of C-Fiber stimulation are both epistemically possible and metaphysically possible. One could adopt a Possibility Account of modal illusions but deny that the dualist intuitions count as modal illusions. Accordingly, the propositions expressed by the sentences ‘philosophical zombies do not exist,’ and ‘pain is C-Fiber stimulation’ would not count as genuine instances of the “necessary a posteriori”.

9. Objections

a. Conceivability and Possibility

There is a common view that conceivability implies possibility. Gendler and Hawthorne (2007) discuss this alleged implication in detail in their introduction to Conceivability and Possibility. According to this view it cannot both be true that water could not have been XYZ and that someone might conceive that water is XYZ. If conceivability implies possibility and a person conceives that water is or could have been XYZ, then it must be possible that water could have been XYZ.  However, given Kripke’s convincing arguments, most will reject this conclusion. On the other hand, if conceivability implies possibility and water could not have been XYZ, then a person who says she conceives that water is or could have been XYZ must not really be conceiving what she claims to conceive. This motivates some who adopt a view claiming the belief needs to be redescribed. Given the objection to such accounts – including the strong objection that we do believe impossibilities – it seems equally objectionable to claim that the person is not really conceiving of water when she claims to conceive that water might have been XYZ.

There does not seem to be an independent reason to maintain the link between conceivability and possibility. If conceivability does not imply possibility, then it might be the case that while water could not have been XYZ, one might conceive that it could have been.  If conceivability does not imply possibility, some version of a Possibility Account would have more force. While there does not seem to be an independent reason to maintain the link between conceivability and possibility, there are many reasons to reject it. First of all, our modal intuitions are not infallible, so we would have no reason to believe that whatever seems possible is possible. To think so is to give more credit than is due to our modal intuitions. If our modal intuitions were infallible, we would be unable to explain other modal errors that we make, such as our mathematical errors. Secondly, modal justification itself is not something philosophers have come to agree upon. We are still not sure what justifies our modal knowledge and so we cannot hold, at this time, that our modal intuitions always count as knowledge. Finally, our a posteriori justification in general is fallible. Since this is so, we have good reason to think that our a posteriori justification when it comes to modal truths might also be fallible.

b. Impossible Worlds

Chalmers objects to Possibility Accounts, or what he calls “two-senses views,” because he believes such accounts are committed to incorporating impossible worlds into their metaphysics. If p is impossible, yet epistemically possible, it must be true in some possible world, but if p is metaphysically impossible, it is true in no possible world. Therefore, it seems that there are metaphysically impossible worlds in which p is true or at which p is true. The idea of countenancing world that are impossible strikes many philosophers as highly problematic.

However, not all possibility accounts, or two-senses views, are committed to impossible worlds. If the definition of ‘possibility’ relies on possible worlds, this might be a valid concern, but not all Possibility Accounts rely on such a definition. For example, Yablo makes no mention of possible worlds. According to Yablo, p is conceptually possible if p is a way the world could have turned out to be. Yablo (1996) insists that a way the world could have turned out to be is not a possible world; it is not an entity at all.  A way the world could have been or could be is analogous to a way one feels or a way a bird might build a nest and when one talks about a way a bird might build a nest, one does not make reference to a thing.

c. Metaphysical Possibility

Perhaps the most forceful objection to a Possibility Account is that it presumes there is some sort of primitive notion of metaphysical modality that is left undefined, one that cannot be identified or analyzed in non-modal terms. Those who use the terms ‘metaphysically necessary’ or ‘metaphysically possible’ have only explained how they use the term, but no one has given an analysis of what these terms mean. The question arises as to what may be meant by 'water is necessarily H2O', as it seems to beg the question, “If this does not just reduce to possible worlds or to the a priori, then what does it reduce to, if anything?”

Some have argued that these notions are vague and that, although there are examples of what most people mean by metaphysically necessary and possible, there is no clear way to decide what counts as metaphysically possible in the problematic cases, including cases that have the dualists’ concerns at their center.

This is a strong objection but perhaps not an insurmountable one. While there are no clear definitions of these terms in the literature, most philosophers who use them have a basic understanding of what they mean. There is some intuitive sense that philosophers, following Kripke, have in mind. Furthermore, philosopher and non-philosophers alike do think that, although things are one way, some things could have been otherwise. It is this notion that philosophers are referring to when they use the term ‘metaphysical possibility.’  Kripke himself recognizes that there are no good definitions for these terms and that there are no necessary and sufficient conditions spelled out for either metaphysical necessity or metaphysical possibility. Still, we have a basic understanding of these notions. If p is necessary, p could not have been otherwise and ¬p could not have been true. If p is false but possible then p could have been the case even though it is not actually the case.

10. References and Further Reading

  • Barcan Marcus, R. (1983). Rationality and Believing the Impossible. Journal of Philosophy. Vol. 80, No. 6, (June 1983). pp. 321-388.
  • Bealer, G. (2004). The Origins of Modal Error. Dialectica, Vol. 58, pp. 11-42.
  • Bealer, G. (2002). Modal Epistemology and the Rationalist Renaissance. In Gendler & Hawthorne, (Eds.), Conceivability and Possibility. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bigelow, J. & Pargetter, R. (1990). Acquaintance With Qualia. Theoria. Vol. 56. pp. 129-147.
  • Byrne, A. (2007). Possibility and Imagination. Philosophical Perspectives. 21. pp. 125-144.
  • Byrne, A. (1993). The Emergent Mind, Ph.D. Dissertation, Princeton University.
  • Chalmers, D. (2007). Propositions and Attitude Ascriptions: A Fregean Account. Nous.
  • Chalmers, D. (2006). The Foundations of Two-Dimensional Semantics. In M. Garcia-Carpintero and J. Macia (eds.), Two-Dimensional Semantics. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 55-140.
  • Chalmers, D. (2002). Does Conceivability Entail Possibility? In T. Gendler & J. Hawthorne (eds.), Conceivability and Possibility. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 145-200.
  • Chalmers, D. (1996). The Conscious Mind. Oxford, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Della Rocca, M. (2002). Essentialism versus Essentialism. In T. Gendler & J. Hawthorne (eds.), Conceivability and Possibility. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 223-252.
  • Descartes, R. (1996). Meditations on First Philosophy, translated by J. Cottingham. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Descartes, R. (1983). Principles of Philosophy, translated by V.R. Miller & R.P. Miller. Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Evans, G. (2006). Comments on ‘Two Notions of Necessity.’ In M. Garcia-Carpintero and J. Macia (eds.), Two-Dimensional Semantics. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 176-180.
  • Fine, K. (2002). The Varieties of Necessity. In T. Gendler & J. Hawthorne (eds.), Conceivability and Possibility. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 253-282.
  • Garcia-Carpintero, M. & Macia, J. (eds.). (2006). Two-Dimensional Semantics. Oxford & New York:  Oxford University Press.
  • Gendler, T.S. & Hawthorne, J. (eds.). (2002). Conceivability and Possibility. Oxford & New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Hill, C. (2006). Modality, Modal Epistemology, and the Metaphysics of Consciousness. In S. Nichol, (ed.), The Architecture of Imagination. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 205-235.
  • Hill, C. (1997). Imaginability, Conceivability, Possibility, and the Mind-Body Problem. Philosophical Studies: 87: pp. 61-85.
  • Hill, C. (1991). Sensations: A Defense of Type Materialism. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jackson, F. (2003). Mind and Illusion. In A. O’Hear, (ed.), Mind and Persons. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. pp. 251-272.
  • Jackson, F. (1997). From Metaphysics to Ethics: A Defense of Conceptual Analysis. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kripke, S. (1972). Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Kripke, S. (1971). Identity and Necessity.  In M.K. Munitz (ed.), Identity and Individuation. New York: New York University Press.
  • Loar, B. (1990). Phenomenal States. Philosophical Perspectives. Vol. 4. pp. 81-108.
  • Ludwig, K. (2003). The Mind-Body Problem: An Overview. In T. A. Warfield & S P. Stich, (eds.), The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Mind. Maldin, MA: Blackwell. pp. 1-46.
  • Lycan, W. G. (1995). A Limited Defense of Phenomenal Information. In T. Metzinger (ed.), Conscious Experience. Paderborn. Schoningh. pp. 243-258.
  • Salmon, N. (2005). Reference and Essence. Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books.
  • Sidelle, A. (2002). On the Metaphysical Contingency of the Laws of Nature. In T. Gendler & J. Hawthorne (eds.), Conceivability and Possibility. Oxford: Oxford University Press. Pp, 309-366.
  • Soames, S. (2006). Kripke, the Necessary A Posteriori, and the Two-Dimensionalist Heresy. In M. Garcia-Carpintero and J. Macia (eds.), Two Dimensional Semantics. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 272-292.
  • Soames, S. (2005). Reference and Description. Princeton and Oxford: Princeton University Press.
  • Sorensen, R. (2006). Meta-Conceivability and Thought Experiments. In S. Nichols (ed.), The Architecture of Imagination. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 257-272.
  • Sorensen, R. (2002). The Art of the Impossible. In T. Gendler & J. Hawthorne (eds.), Conceivability and Possibility. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 337-368.
  • Sorensen, R. (1996). Modal Bloopers: Why Believable Impossibilities are Necessary. American Philosophical Quarterly, 33 (1): pp, 247-261.
  • Sorensen, R. (1992). Thought Experiments. NY: Oxford University Press.
  • Tye, M. (1995). Ten Problems of Consciousness. Cambridge, MA. MIT Press.
  • Wong, K. (2006). Two-Dimensionalism and Kripkean A Posteriori Necessity. In M. Garcia-Carpintero and J. Macia (eds.), Two-Dimensional Semantics. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 310-326.
  • Yablo, S. (2006). No Fool’s Cold: Notes on Illusions of Possibility. In M. Garcia-Carpintero and J. Macia (eds.), Two-Dimensional Semantics. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 327-346.
  • Yablo, S. (2001). Coulda Shoulda Woulda. In T. Gendler & J. Hawthorne (eds.), Conceivability and Possibility. Oxford: Oxford University Press. pp. 441-492.
  • Yablo, S. (2000). Textbook Kripkeanism and the Open Texture of Concepts. Pacific Philosophical Quarterly. 81: pp, 98-122.
  • Yablo, S. (1996). How In the World? Philosophical Topics. 24. pp. 255-286.
  • Yablo, S. (1993). Is Conceivability a Guide to Possibility? Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 53: pp. 1-42.

Author Information

Leigh Duffy
Buffalo State College
U. S. A.


Epistemic foundationalism is a view about the proper structure of one’s knowledge or justified beliefs.  Some beliefs are known or justifiedly believed only because some other beliefs are known or justifiedly believed.  For example, you can know that you have heart disease only if you know some other claims such as your doctors report this and doctors are reliable.  The support these beliefs provide for your belief that you have heart disease illustrates that your first belief is epistemically dependent on these other two beliefs.  This epistemic dependence naturally raises the question about the proper epistemic structure for our beliefs.  Should all beliefs be supported by other beliefs?  Are some beliefs rightly believed apart from receiving support from other beliefs?  What is the nature of the proper support between beliefs?  Epistemic foundationalism is one view about how to answer these questions.  Foundationalists maintain that some beliefs are properly basic and that the rest of one’s beliefs inherit their epistemic status (knowledge or justification) in virtue of receiving proper support from the basic beliefs.  Foundationalists have two main projects: a theory of proper basicality (that is, a theory of noninferential justification) and a theory of appropriate support (that is, a theory of inferential justification).

Foundationalism has a long history.  Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics argues for foundationalism on the basis of the regress argument.  Aristotle assumes that the alternatives to foundationalism must either endorse circular reasoning or land in an infinite regress of reasons.  Because neither of these views is plausible, foundationalism comes out as the clear winner in an argument by elimination.  Arguably, the most well known foundationalist is Descartes, who takes as the foundation the allegedly indubitable knowledge of his own existence and the content of his ideas.  Every other justified belief must be grounded ultimately in this knowledge.

The debate over foundationalism was reinvigorated in the early part of the twentieth century by the debate over the nature of the scientific method.  Otto Neurath (1959; original 1932) argued for a view of scientific knowledge illuminated by the raft metaphor according to which there is no privileged set of statements that serve as the ultimate foundation; rather knowledge arises out of a coherence among the set of statements we accept.  In opposition to this raft metaphor, Moritz Schlick (1959; original 1932) argued for a view of scientific knowledge akin to the pyramid image in which knowledge rests on a special class of statements whose verification doesn’t depend on other beliefs.

The Neurath-Schlick debate transformed into a discussion over nature and role of observation sentences within a theory.  Quine (1951) extended this debate with his metaphor of the web of belief in which observation sentences are able to confirm or disconfirm a hypothesis only in connection with a larger theory.  Sellars (1963) criticizes foundationalism as endorsing a flawed model of the cognitive significance of experience.  Following the work of Quine and Sellars, a number of people arose to defend foundationalism (see section below on modest foundationalism).  This touched off a burst of activity on foundationalism in the late 1970s to early 1980s.  One of the significant developments from this period is the formulation and defense of reformed epistemology, a foundationalist view that took as the foundations beliefs such as there is a God (see Plantinga (1983)). While the debate over foundationalism has abated in recent decades, new work has picked up on neglected topics about the architecture of knowledge and justification.

Table of Contents

  1. Knowledge and Justification
  2. Arguments for Foundationalism
    1. The Regress Argument
    2. Natural Judgment about Cases
  3. Arguments against Foundationalism
    1. The Problem of Arbitrariness
    2. The Sellarsian Dilemma
  4. Types of Foundationalist Views
    1. Theories of Noninferential Justification
      1. Strong Foundationalism
      2. Modest Foundationalism
      3. Weak Foundationalism
    2. Theories of Proper Inference
      1. Deductivism
      2. Strict Inductivism
      3. Liberal Inductivism
      4. A Theory of Inference and A Theory of Concepts
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Knowledge and Justification

The foundationalist attempts to answer the question: what is the proper structure of one’s knowledge or justified beliefs? This question assumes a prior grasp of the concepts of knowledge and justification.  Before the development of externalist theories of knowledge (see entry on internalism and externalism in epistemology) it was assumed that knowledge required justification.  On a standard conception of knowledge, knowledge was justified true belief.  Thus investigation on foundationalism focused on the structural conditions for justification.  How should one’s beliefs be structured so as to be justified?  The following essay discusses foundationalism in terms of justification (see BonJour (1985) for a defense of the claim that knowledge requires justification).  Where the distinction between justification and knowledge is relevant (for example, weak foundationalism), this article will observe it.

What is it for a belief to be justified?  Alvin Plantinga (1993) observes that the notion of justification is heavily steeped in deontological terms, terms like rightness, obligation, and duty.  A belief is justified for a person if and only if the person is right to believe it or the subject has fulfilled her intellectual duties relating to the belief.  Laurence BonJour (1985) presents a slightly different take on the concept of justification stating that it is “roughly that of a reason or warrant of some kind meeting some appropriate standard” (pp., 5-6).  This ‘appropriate standard’ conception of justification permits a wider understanding of the concept of justification.  BonJour, for instance, takes the distinguishing characteristic of justification to be “its essential or internal relation to the cognitive goal of truth” (p. 8).  Most accounts of justification assume some form of epistemic internalism.  Roughly speaking, this is the view that a belief’s justification does not require that it meets some condition external to a subject’s perspective, conditions such as being true, being produced by a reliable process, or being caused by the corresponding fact (see entry on internalism and externalism in epistemology).  All the relevant conditions for justification are ‘internal’ to a subject’s perspective.  These conditions vary from facts about a subject’s occurrent beliefs and experiences to facts about a subject’s occurrent and stored beliefs and experiences and further to facts simply about a subject’s mind, where this may include information that, in some sense or other, a subject has difficulty bringing to explicit consciousness.  Although some externalists offer accounts of justification (see Goldman (1979) & Bergmann (2006)), this article assumes that justification is internalistic.  Externalists have a much easier time addressing concerns over foundationalism.  It is a common judgment that the foundationalist / coherentist debate takes place within the backdrop of internalism (see BonJour (1999)).

2. Arguments for Foundationalism

This section discusses prominent arguments for a general type of foundationalism.  Section 4, on varieties of foundationalism, discusses more specific arguments aimed to defend a particular species of foundationalism.

a. The Regress Argument



The epistemic regress problem has a long history.  Aristotle used the regress argument to prove that justification requires basic beliefs, beliefs that are not supported by any other beliefs but are able to support further beliefs (see Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics I.3:5-23).  The regress problem was prominent in the writings of the academic skeptics, especially Sextus Empiricus’s Outlines of Pyrrhonism and Diogenes Laertius “The Life of Pyrrho” in his book The Lives and Options of Eminent Philosophers.  In the 20th century the regress problem has received new life in the development of the coherentist and infinitist options (see BonJour (1985) and Klein (1999), respectively).

To appreciate the regress problem begin with the thought that the best way to have a good reason for some claim is to have an argument from which the claim follows.  Thus one possesses good reason to believe p when it follows from the premises q and r.  But then we must inquire about the justification for believing the premises.  Does one have a good argument for the premises?  Suppose one does.  Then we can inquire about the justification for those premises.  Does one have an argument for those claims?  If not, then it appears one lacks a good reason for the original claim because the original claim is ultimately based on claims for which no reason is offered.  If one does have an argument for those premises then either one will continue to trace out the chain of arguments to some premises for which no further reason is offered or one will trace out the chain of arguments until one loops back to the original claims or one will continue to trace out the arguments without end.  We can then begin to see the significance of the regress problem: is it arguments all the way down?  Does one eventually come back to premises that appeared in earlier arguments or does one eventually come to some ultimate premises, premises that support other claims but do not themselves require any additional support?

Skepticism aside, the options in the regress problem are known as foundationalism, coherentism, and infinitism.  Foundationalists maintain that there are some ultimate premises, premises that provide good reasons for other claims but themselves do not require additional reasons.  These ultimate premises are the proper stopping points in the regress argument.  Foundationalists hold that the other options for ending the regress are deeply problematic and that consequently there must be basic beliefs.

Coherentists and infinitists deny that there are any ultimate premises.  A simple form of coherentism holds that the arguments for any claim will eventually loop back to the original claim itself.  As long as the circle of justifications is large enough it is rationally acceptable.  After all, every claim is supported by some other claim and, arguably, the claims fit together in such a way to provide an explanation of their truth (see Lehrer (1997), Chs 1 & 2)

Infinitists think that both the foundationalist and coherentist options are epistemically objectionable.  Infinitists (as well as coherentists) claim that the foundationalist options land in arbitrary premises, premises that are alleged to support other claims but themselves lack reasons.  Against the coherentist, infinitists claim that it simply endorses circular reasoning: no matter how big the circle, circular arguments do not establish that the original claim is true.  Positively, infinitists maintain that possessing a good reason for a claim requires that it be supported by an infinite string of non-repeating reasons (see Klein (1999)).

Foundationalists use the regress argument to set up the alternative epistemological positions and then proceed to knock down these positions.  Foundationalists argue against infinitism that we never possess an infinite chain of non-repeating reasons.  At best when we consider the justification for some claim we are able to carry this justification out several steps but we never come close to anything resembling an unending chain of justifications.  For this criticism and others of infinitism see Fumerton (1998).

Against the coherentist the foundationalist agrees with the infinitist’s criticism mentioned above that circular reasoning never justifies anything.  If p is used to support q then q itself cannot be used in defense of p no matter how many intermediate steps there are between q and p.  This verdict against simple coherentism is strong, but foundationalist strategy is complicated by the fact that it is hard to find an actual coherentist who endorses circular reasoning (though see Lehrer (1997) Ch 1 and 2 for remarks about the circular nature of explanation).  Coherentists, rather, identify the assumption of linear inference in the regress argument and replace it with a stress on the holistic character of justification (see BonJour (1985)).  The assumption of linear inference in the regress argument is clearly seen above by the idea that the regress traces out arguments for some claim, where the premises of those arguments are known or justifiedly believed prior to the conclusion being known or justified believed.  The form of coherentism that rejects this assumption in the regress argument is known as holistic coherentism.

Foundationalist arguments against holistic coherentism must proceed with more care.  Because holistic coherentists disavow circular reasoning and stress the mistaken role of linear inference in the regress argument, foundationalists must supply a different argument against this option.  A standard argument against holistic coherentism is that unless the data used for coherence reasoning has some initial justification it is impossible for coherence reasoning to provide justification.  This problem affected Laurence BonJour’s attempt to defend coherentism (see BonJour (1985), pp. 102-3).  BonJour argued that coherence among one’s beliefs provided excellent reason to think that those beliefs were true.  But BonJour realized that he needed an account of how one was justified in believing that one had certain beliefs, i.e., what justified one in thinking that one did indeed hold the system of beliefs one takes oneself to believe.  BonJour quickly recognized that coherence couldn’t provide justification for this belief but it wasn’t until later in his career that he deemed this problem insuperable for a pure coherentist account (see BonJour (1997) for details).

The regress problem provides a powerful argument for foundationalism.  The regress argument, though, does not resolve particular questions about foundationalism.  The regress provides little guidance about the nature of basic beliefs or the correct theory of inferential support.  As we just observed with the discussion of holistic coherentism, considerations from the regress argument show, minimally, that the data used for coherence reasoning must have some initial presumption in its favor.  This form of foundationalism may be far from the initial hope of a rational reconstruction of common sense.  Such a reconstruction would amount to setting out in clear order the arguments for various commonsense claims (for example, I have hands, there is a material world, I have existed for more than five minutes, etc) that exhibits the ultimate basis for our view of things.  We shall consider the issues relating to varieties of foundationalists views below.

b. Natural Judgment about Cases

Another powerful consideration for foundationalism is our natural judgment about particular cases.  It seems evident that some beliefs are properly basic.  Leibniz, for instance, gives several examples of claims that don’t “involve any work of proving” and that “the mind perceives as immediately as the eye sees light” (see New Essays, IV, chapter 2, 1).  Leibniz mentions the following examples:

White is not black.

A circle is not a triangle.

Three is one and two.

Other philosophers (for example, C.I. Lewis, Roderick Chisholm, and Richard Fumerton) have found examples of such propositions in appearance states (traditionally, referred to as the given).  For instance, it may not be evident that there is a red circle before one because one may be in a misleading situation (for example, a red light shining on a white circle).  However, if one carefully considers the matter one may be convinced that something appears red.  Foundationalists stress that it is difficult to see what one could offer as a further justification for the claim about how things seem to one.  In short, truths about one’s appearance states are excellent candidates for basic beliefs.

As we shall see below a feature of this appeal to natural judgment is that it can support strong forms of foundationalism.  Richard Fumerton maintains that for some cases, for example, pain states, one’s belief can reach the highest level of philosophical assurance (see Fumerton (2006)).  Other philosophers (for example, James Pryor (2000)) maintain that some ordinary propositions, such as I have hands, are foundational.

3. Arguments Against Foundationalism

This section examines two general arguments against foundationalism.  Arguments against specific incarnations of foundationalism are considered in section 4.

a. The Problem of Arbitrariness

As noted above the regress argument figures prominently in arguing for foundationalism.  The regress argument supports the conclusion that some beliefs must be justified independently of receiving warrant from other beliefs.  However, some philosophers judge that this claim amounts to accepting some beliefs as true for no reason at all, that is, epistemically arbitrary beliefs.  This objection has significant bite against a doxastic form of foundationalism (the language of ‘doxastic’ comes from the Greek word ‘doxa’ meaning belief).  Doxastic foundationalism is the view that the justification of one’s beliefs is exclusively a matter of what other beliefs one holds.  Regarding the basic beliefs, a doxastic foundationalist holds that these beliefs are ‘self-justified’ (see Pollock & Cruz (1999), 22-23).  The content of the basic beliefs are typically perceptual reports but importantly a doxastic foundationalist does not conceive of one’s corresponding perceptual state as a reason for the belief.  Doxastic foundationalists hold that one is justified in accepting a perceptual report simply because one has the belief.  However, given the fallibility of perceptual reports, it is epistemically arbitrary to accept a perceptual report for no reason at all.

The arbitrariness objection against non-doxastic theories must proceed with more care.  A non-doxastic form of foundationalism denies that justification is exclusively a matter of relations between one’s beliefs.  Consider a non-doxastic foundationalist that attempts to stop the regress with non-doxastic states like experiences.  This foundationalist claims that, for example, the belief that there is a red disk before one is properly basic.  This belief is not justified on the basis of any other beliefs but instead justified by the character of one’s sense experience.  Because one can tell by reflection alone that one’s experience has a certain character, the experience itself provides one with an excellent reason for the belief.  The critic of non-doxastic foundationalism argues that stopping with this experience is arbitrary.  After all, there are scenarios in which this experience is misleading.  If, for example, the disk is white but illuminated with red light then one’s experience will misled one to think that the disk is really red.Unless one has a reason to think that these scenarios fail to obtain then it’s improper to stop the regress of reasons here.

One foundationalist solution to the arbitrariness problem is to move to epistemically certain foundations.  Epistemically certain foundations are beliefs that cannot be misleading and so cannot provide a foothold for arbitrariness concerns.  If, for instance, one’s experience is of a red disk and one believes just that one’s experience has this character, it is difficult to see how one’s belief could be mistaken in this specific context.   Consequently, it is hard to make sense of how one’s belief about the character of one’s experience could be epistemically arbitrary.  In general, many foundationalists want to resist this move.  First, relative to the large number of beliefs we have, there are few epistemically certain beliefs. Second, even if one locates a few epistemically certain beliefs, it is very difficult to reconstruct our common-sense view of the world from those beliefs.  If the ultimate premises of one’s view include only beliefs about the current character of one’s sense experience it’s near impossible to figure out how to justify beliefs about the external world or the past.

Another foundationalist response to the arbitrariness argument is to note that it is merely required that a properly basic belief possess some feature in virtue of which the belief is likely to be true.  It is not required that a subject believe her belief possesses that feature.  This response has the virtue of allowing for modest forms of foundationalism in which the basic beliefs are less than certain.  Critics of foundationalism continue to insist that unless the subject is aware that the belief possesses this feature, her belief is an improper stopping point in the regress of reasons.  For a defense of the arbitrariness objection against foundationalism see Klein (1999) & (2004), and for responses to Klein see Bergmann (2004), Howard-Snyder & Coffman (2006), Howard-Snyder (2005), and Huemer (2003).

b. The Sellarsian Dilemma

The Sellarsian dilemma was first formulated in Wilfrid Sellars’s rich, but difficult, essay “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind.”  Sellars’s main goal in this essay is to undermine the entire framework of givenness ((1963), p. 128).  Talk of ‘the given’ was prevalent in earlier forms of foundationalism (see, for example, C.I. Lewis (1929), Ch 2).  The phrase ‘the given’ refers to elements of experience that are putatively immediately known in experience.  For instance, if one looks at a verdant golf course the sensation green is alleged to be given in experience. In a Cartesian moment one may doubt whether or not one is actually perceiving a golf course but, the claim is, one cannot rationally doubt that there is a green sensation present. Strong foundationalists appeal to the given to ground empirical knowledge.  In “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind” Sellars argues that the idea of the given is a myth.

The details of Sellars’ actual argument are difficult to decipher.  The most promising reconstruction of Sellars’ argument occurs in chapter 4 of BonJour’s (1985).  BonJour formulates the dilemma using the notion of ‘assertive representational content’.  Representational content is the kind of content possessed by beliefs, hopes, and fears.  A belief, a hope, or a fear could be about the same thing; one could believe that it is raining, hope that it is raining, or fear that it is raining.  These states all have in common the same representational contentAssertive representational content is content that is presented as being true but may, in fact, be false.  A good case of assertive content comes from the Müller-Lyer illusion.  In this well-known experiment a subject experiences two vertical lines as being unequal in length even though they have the same length.  The subject’s experience presents as true the content that these lines are unequal.

Given the notion of assertive representational content BonJour reformulates the Sellarsian dilemma: either experience has assertive representational content or not.  If experience has assertive representational content then one needs an additional reason to think that the content is correct.  If, however, experience lacks this content then experience cannot provide a reason for thinking that some proposition is true.  The dilemma focuses on non-doxastic foundationalism and is used to argue that anyway the view is filled out, it cannot make good on the intuition that experience is a proper foundation for justification.

Let us examine each option of the dilemma staring with the second option.  A defense of this option observes that it is difficult to understand how experience could provide a good reason for believing some claim if it failed to have representational content.  Think of the olfactory experience associated with a field of flowers in full bloom.  Apart from a formed association between that experience and its cause, it is difficult to understand how that experience has representational content.  In other words, the experience lacks any content; it makes no claim that the world is one way rather than another.  However, if that is right, how could that experience provide any reason for believing that the world is one way rather than another?  If the experience itself is purely qualitative then it cannot provide a reason to believe that some proposition is true.  In short, there is a strong judgment that apart from the representational content of experience, experience is powerless to provide reasons.

A defense of the first option of the dilemma takes us back to issues raised by the arbitrariness objection.  If experience does have assertive representational content then that content can be true or false.  If the content is possibly false, the experience is not a proper stopping point in the regress of reasons.  The whole idea behind the appeal to the given was to stop the regress of reasons in a state that did not require further justification because it was not the sort of thing that needed justification.  If experience, like belief, has representational content then there is no good reason to stop the regress of reasons with experience rather than belief.  In brief, if experience functions as a reason in virtue of its assertive representational content then there is nothing special about experience as opposed to belief in its ability to provide reasons.  Since the arbitrariness objection shows that belief is not a proper stopping point in the regress, the Sellarsian dilemma shows that experience is not a proper stopping point either.

Probably the best foundationalist response to the Sellarsian dilemma is to argue that the first option of the dilemma is mistaken; experience has assertive propositional content and can still provide a regress stopping reason to believe that some claim is true.  There are broadly two kinds of responses here depending on whether one thinks that the content of experience could be false.  On one view, experience carries a content that may be false but that this experiential content provides a basic reason for thinking that this content is true.  For instance, it may perceptually seem to one that there is a coffee mug on the right corner of the desk.  This content may be false but in virtue of its being presented as true in experience one has a basic reason for thinking that it is true (see Pryor (2000) & Huemer (2001) for developments of this view).  The other view one might take is that experiential content—at least the kind that provides a basic reason—cannot be false.  One this view the kind of content that experience provides for a basic reason is something like this: it perceptually seems that there is a red disk before me.  Laurence BonJour (in BonJour & Sosa (2003)) develops a view like this.  On his view, one has a built-in constitutive awareness of experiential content, and in virtue of that awareness of content one has a basic reason to believe that the content is true.   For a good criticism of BonJour’s strategy, see Bergmann (2006), Chapter 2.  For a different, externalist response to the dilemma see Jack Lyons (2008).

See the Encyclopedia article "Coherentism" for more criticism of foundationalism.

4. Types of Foundationalist Views

This section surveys varieties of foundationalist views.  As remarked above foundationalists have two main projects: providing a suitable theory of noninferential justification and providing an adequate theory of proper inference.  We will examine three views on non-inferential justification and three views on inferential justification.

a. Theories of Noninferential Justification

An adequate theory of noninferential justification is essential for foundationalism.  Foundationalist views differ on the nature of noninferential justification.  We can distinguish three types of foundationalist views corresponding to the strength of justification possessed by the basic beliefs: strong, modest, and weak foundationalism.  In the following we shall examine these three views and the arguments for and against them.

i. Strong Foundationalism

Strong foundationalists hold that the properly basic beliefs are epistemically exalted in some interesting sense.  In addition to basic beliefs possessing the kind of justification necessary for knowledge (let us refer to this as “knowledge level justification”) strong foundationalists claim the properly basic beliefs are infallible, indubitable, or incorrigible.  Infallible beliefs are not possibly false.  Indubitable beliefs are not possible to doubt even though the content may be false, and incorrigible beliefs cannot be undermined by further information.  The focus on these exalted epistemic properties grows out of Descartes’ method of doubt.  Descartes aimed to locate secure foundations for knowledge and dismissed any claims that were fallible, dubitable, or corrigible.  Thus, Descartes sought the foundations of knowledge in restricted mental states like I am thinking.  Before we examine arguments against strong foundationalism let us investigate some arguments in favor of it.

Probably the most widespread argument for strong foundationalism is the need for philosophical assurance concerning the truth of one’s beliefs (see Fumerton (2006)).  If one adopts the philosophical undertaking to trace out the ultimate reasons for one’s view it can seem particularly remiss to stop this philosophical quest with fallible, dubitable, or corrigible reasons.  As Descartes realized if the possibility that one is dreaming is compatible with one’s evidence then that evidence is not an adequate ground for a philosophical satisfying reconstruction of knowledge.  Consequently, if a philosophically satisfying perspective of knowledge is to be found it will be located in foundations that are immune from doubt.

Another argument for strong foundationalism is C.I. Lewis’s contention that probability must be grounded in certainty (see Lewis (1952); also see Pastin (1975a) for a response to Lewis’s argument).  Lewis’s argument appeals explicitly to the probability calculus but we can restate the driving intuition apart from utilizing any formal machinery. Lewis reasoned that if a claim is uncertain then it is rationally acceptable only given further information.  If that further information is uncertain then it is acceptable only given additional information.  If this regress continues without ever coming to a certainty then Lewis conjectures that the original claim is not rationally acceptable.

We can get a sense of Lewis’s intuition by considering a conspiracy theorist that has a defense for every claim in his convoluted chain of reasoning.  We might think that, in general, the theorist is right about the conditional claims—if this is true then that is probably correct—but just plain wrong that the entire chain of arguments supports the conspiracy theory.  We correctly realize that the longer the chain of reasoning the less likely the conclusion is true.  The chance of error grows with the amount of information.  Lewis’s argument takes this intuition to its limit: unless uncertainties are grounded in certainties no claim is ever rationally acceptable.

Let us examine several arguments against strong foundationalism.  The most repeated argument against strong foundationalism is that its foundations are inadequate for a philosophical reconstruction of knowledge.  We take ourselves to know much about the world around us from mundane facts about our immediate surroundings to more exotic facts about the far reaches of the universe.  Yet if the basic material for this reconstruction is restricted to facts about an individual’s own mind it is nearly impossible to figure out how we can get back to our ordinary picture of the world.  In this connection strong foundationalists face an inherent tension between the quest for epistemic security and the hope for suitable content to reconstruct commonsense.  Few strong foundationalists have been able to find a suitable balance between these competing demands.  Some philosophers with a more metaphysical bent aimed to reduce each statement about the material world to a logical construction of statements about an individual’s own sense experience.  This project is known as phenomenalism.  The phenomenalist’ guiding idea was that statements about the physical world were really complex statements about sensations.  If this guiding idea could be worked out then strong foundationalist would have a clear conception of how the “commonsense” picture of the world could be justified.  However, this guiding idea could never be worked out.  See, for instance, Roderick Chisholm’s (1948) article.

Another argument against strong foundationalism is David Armstrong’s ‘distinct existence’ argument ((1968), 106-7).  Armstrong argues that there is a difference between an awareness of X and X, where X is some mental state.  For instance, there is a difference between being in pain and awareness of being in pain.  As long as awareness of X is distinct from X, Armstrong argues that it is possible for one to seemingly be aware of X without X actually occurring.  For instance, an intense pain that gradually fades away can lead to a moment in which one has a false awareness of being in pain.  Consequently, the thought that one can enjoy an infallible awareness of some mental state is mistaken.

A recent argument against strong foundationalism is Timothy Williamson’s anti-luminosity argument (see Williamson (2000)).  Williamson does not talk about foundationalism but talks rather in terms of the ongoing temptation in philosophy to postulate a realm of luminous truths, truths that shine so brightly they are always open to our view if we carefully consider the matter.  Even though Williamson doesn’t mention foundationalism his argument clearly applies to the strong foundationalist.  Williamson’s actual argument is intricate and we cannot go into it in much detail.  The basic idea behind Williamson’s argument is that appearance states (for example, it seems as if there is a red item before you) permit of a range of similar cases.  Think of color samples.  There is a string of color samples from red to orange in which each shade is very similar to the next.  If appearance states genuinely provided certainty, indubitability, or the like then one should be able to always tell what state one was in.  But there are cases that are so similar that one might make a mistake.  Thus, because of the fact that appearance states ebb and flow, they cannot provide certainty, indubitability or the like.  There is a burgeoning discussion of the anti-luminosity argument; see Fumerton (2009) for a strong foundationalist response and Meeker & Poston (2010) for a recent discussion and references).

ii. Modest Foundationalism

Prior to 1975 foundationalism was largely identified with strong foundationalism.  Critics of foundationalism attacked the claims that basic beliefs are infallible, incorrigible, or indubitable.  However, around this time there was a growing recognition that foundationalism was compatible with basic beliefs that lacked these epistemically exalted properties.  William Alston (1976a; 1976b), C.F. Delaney (1976), and Mark Pastin (1975a; 1975b) all argued that a foundationalist epistemology merely required that the basic beliefs have a level of positive epistemic status independent of warranting relations from other beliefs. In light of this weaker form of foundationalism the attacks against infallibility, incorrigibility, or indubitability did not touch the core of a foundationalist epistemology.

William Alston probably did the most to rehabilitate foundationalism.  Alston provides several interrelated distinctions that illustrate the limited appeal of certain arguments against strong foundationalism and also displays the attractiveness of modest foundationalism.  The first distinction Alston drew was between epistemic beliefs and non-epistemic beliefs (see 1976a).  Epistemic beliefs are beliefs whose content contains an epistemic concept such as knowledge or justification, whereas a non-epistemic belief does not contain an epistemic concept.  The belief that there is a red circle before me is not an epistemic belief because its content does not contain any epistemic concepts.  However, the belief that I am justified in believing that there is a red, circle before me is an epistemic belief on account of the epistemic concept justified figuring in its content.   Alston observes that prominent arguments against foundationalism tend to run together these two beliefs.  For instance, an argument against foundationalism might require that to be justified in believing that p one must justifiedly believe that I am justified in believing that p.  That is, the argument against foundationalism assumes that epistemic beliefs are required for the justification of non-epistemic beliefs.  As Alston sees it, once these two types of belief are clearly separated we should be suspicious of any such argument that requires epistemic beliefs for the justification of non-epistemic beliefs (for details see (1976a) and (1976b)).

A closely related distinction for Alston is the distinction between the state of being justified and the activity of exhibiting one’s justification.  Alston argues in a like manner that prominent objections to foundationalism conflate these two notions.  The state of being justified does not imply that one can exhibit one’s justification.  Reflection on actual examples support Alston’s claim.  Grandma may be justified in believing that she has hands without being in a position to exhibit her justification.  Timmy is justified in believing that he has existed for more than five minutes but he can do very little to demonstrate his justification.  Therefore, arguments against foundationalism should not assume that justification requires the ability to exhibit one’s justification.

A final, closely allied, distinction is between a justification regress argument and a showing regress argument.  Alston argues that the standard regress argument is a regress of justification that points to the necessity of immediately justified beliefs.  This argument is distinct from a showing regress in which the aim is to demonstrate that one is justified in believing p.  This showing regress requires that one proves that one is justified in believing p for each belief one has.  Given Alston’s earlier distinctions this implies that one must have epistemic beliefs for each non-epistemic belief and further it conflates the distinction between the state of being justified and the activity of exhibiting one’s justification.

With these three distinctions in place and the further claim that immediately justified beliefs may be fallible, revisable, and dubitable Alston makes quick work of the standard objections to strong foundationalism.  The arguments against strong foundationalism fail to apply to modest foundationalism and further have no force against the claim that some beliefs have a strong presumption of truth.  Reflection on actual cases supports Alston’s claim.  Grandma’s belief that she has hands might be false and revised in light of future evidence.  Perhaps, Grandma has been fitted with a prosthetic device that looks and functions just like a normal hand.  Nonetheless when she looks and appears to see a hand, she is fully justified in believing that she has hands.

Alston’s discussion of modest foundationalism does not mention weaker forms of foundationalism.  Further Alston is not clear on the precise epistemic status on these foundations.  Alston describes the ‘minimal’ form of foundationalism as simply being committed to non-inferentially justified beliefs.  However, as we shall shortly see BonJour identifies a modest and weak form of foundationalism.  For purposes of terminological regimentation we shall take ‘modest’ foundationalism to be the claim that the basic beliefs possess knowledge adequate justification even though these beliefs may be fallible, corrigible, or dubitable.  A corollary to modest foundationalism is the thesis that the basic beliefs can serve as premises for additional beliefs.  The picture then the modest foundationalist offers us is that of knowledge (and justification) as resting on a foundation of propositions whose positive epistemic status is sufficient to infer other beliefs but whose positive status may be undermined by further information.

A significant development in modest foundationalism is the rise of reformed epistemology.  Reformed epistemology is a view in the epistemology of religious belief, which holds that the belief that there is a God can be properly basic.  Alvin Plantinga (1983) develops this view.  Plantinga holds that an individual may rationally believe that there is a God even though the individual does not possess sufficient evidence to convince an agnostic.  Furthermore, the individual need not know how to respond to various objections to theism.  On Plantinga’s view as long as the belief is produced in the right way it is justified.  Plantinga has developed reformed epistemology in his (2000) volume.  Plantinga develops the view as a form of externalism that holds that the justification conferring factors for a belief may include external factors.

Modest foundationalism is not without its critics.  Some strong foundationalists argue that modest foundationalism is too modest to provide adequate foundations for empirical knowledge (see McGrew (2003)).  Timothy McGrew argues that empirical knowledge must be grounded in certainties.  McGrew deploys an argument similar to C.I. Lewis’s argument that probabilities require certainties.  McGrew argues that every statement that has less than unit probability is grounded in some other statement.  If the probability that it will rain today is .9 then there must be some additional information that one is taking in account to get this probability.  Consequently, if the alleged foundations are merely probable then they are really no foundations at all.  Modest foundationalists disagree.  They hold that some statements may have an intrinsic non-zero probability (see for instance Mark Pastin’s response to C.I. Lewis’s argument in Pastin (1975a)).

iii. Weak Foundationalism

Weak foundationalism is an interesting form of foundationalism.  Laurence BonJour mentions the view as a possible foundationalist view in his (1985) book The Structure of Empirical Knowledge.  According to BonJour the weak foundationalist holds that some non-inferential beliefs are minimally justified, where this justification is not strong enough to satisfy the justification condition on knowledge.  Further this justification is not strong enough to allow the individual beliefs to serve as premises to justify other beliefs (see BonJour (1985), 30).  However, because knowledge and inference are fundamental features to our epistemic practices, a natural corollary to weak foundationalism is that coherence among one’s beliefs is required for knowledge-adequate justification and also for one’s beliefs to function as premises for other beliefs.  Thus for the weak foundationalist, coherence has an ineliminable role for knowledge and inference. 

This form of foundationalism is a significant departure from the natural stress foundationalists place on the regress argument.  Attention on the regress argument focuses one back to the ultimate beliefs of one’s view.  If these beliefs are insufficient to license inference to other beliefs it is difficult to make good sense of a reconstruction of knowledge.  At the very least the reconstruction will not proceed in a step by step manner in which one begins with a limited class of beliefs—the basic ones—and then moves to the non-basic ones.  If, in addition, coherence is required for the basic beliefs to serve as premises for other beliefs then this form of weak foundationalism looks very similar to refined forms of coherentism.

Some modest foundationalists maintain that weak foundationalism is inadequate.  James Van Cleve contends that weak foundationalism is inadequate to generate justification for one’s beliefs (van Cleve (2005)).  Van Cleve presents two arguments for the claim that some beliefs must have a high intrinsic credibility (pp. 173-4).  First, while coherence can increase the justification for thinking that one’s ostensible recollections are correct, one must have significant justification for thinking that one has correctly identified one’s ostensible recollection.  That is to say, one must have more than weak justification for thinking one’s apparent memory does report that p, whether or not this apparent memory is true.  Apart from the thought that one has strong justification for believing that one’s ostensible memory is as one takes it to be, Van Cleve argues it is difficult to see how coherence could increase the justification for believing that those apparent memories are true.

The second argument Van Cleve offers comes from Bertrand Russell ((1948), p. 188).  Russell observes that one fact makes another probable or improbable only in relation to a law.  Therefore, for coherence among certain facts, to make another fact probable one must have sufficient justification for believing a law that connects the facts.  Van Cleve explains that we might not require a genuine law but rather an empirical generalization that connects the two facts.  Nonetheless Russell’s point is that for coherence to increase the probability of some claim we must have more than weak justification for believing some generalization.  The problem for the weak foundationalist is that our justification for believing an empirical generalization depends on memory.  Consequently, memory must supply the needed premise in a coherence argument and it can do this only if memory supplies more than weak justification.  In short, the coherence among ostensible memories increases justification only if we have more than weak justification for believing some generalization provided by memory.

b. Theories of Proper Inference

Much of the attention on foundationalism has focused on the nature and existence of basic beliefs.  Yet a crucial element of foundationalism is the nature of the inferential relations between basic beliefs and non-basic beliefs.  Foundationalists claim that all of one’s non-basic beliefs are justified ultimately by the basic beliefs, but how is this supposed to work?  What are the proper conditions for the justification of the non-basic beliefs?  The following discusses three approaches to inferential justification: deductivism, strict inductivism, and liberal inductivism.

i. Deductivism

Deductivists hold that proper philosophical method consists in the construction of deductively valid arguments whose premises are indubitable or self-evident (see remarks by Nozick (1981) and Lycan (1988)).  Deductivists travel down the regress in order to locate the epistemic atoms from which they attempt to reconstruct the rest of one’s knowledge by deductive inference.  Descartes’ epistemology is often aligned with deductivism.  Descartes locates the epistemically basic beliefs in beliefs about the ideas in one’s mind and then deduces from those ideas that a good God exists.  Then given that a good God exists, Descartes deduces further that the ideas in his mind must correspond to objects in reality.  Therefore, by a careful deductive method, Descartes aims to reconstruct our knowledge of the external world.

Another prominent example of deductivism comes from phenomenalism.  As mentioned earlier, phenomenalism is the attempt to analyze statements about physical objects in terms of statements about patterns of sense data.  Given this analysis, the phenomenalist can deduce our knowledge of the external world from knowledge of our own sensory states.  Whereas Descartes’ deductivism took a theological route through the existence of a good God, the phenomenalist eschews theology and attempts a deductive reconstruction by a metaphysical analysis of statements about the external world.  Though this project is a momentous failure, it illustrates a tendency in philosophy to grasp for certainty.

Contemporary philosophers dismiss deductivism as implausible.  Deductivism requires strong foundationalism because the ultimate premises must be infallible, indubitable, or incorrigible.  However, many philosophers judge that the regress stopping premises need not have these exalted properties. Surely, the thought continues, we know things like I have hands and the world has existed for more than five minutes? Additionally, if one restricts proper inference to deduction then one can never expand upon the information contained in the premises.  Deductive inference traces out logical implications of the information contained in the premises.  So if the basic premises are limited to facts about one’s sensory states then one can’t go ‘beyond’ those states to facts about the external world, the past, or the future.  To accommodate that knowledge we must expand either our premises or our conception of inference.  Either direction abandons the deductivist picture of proper philosophical method.

ii. Strict Inductivism

One response to the above challenge for deductivism is to move to modest foundationalism, which allows the basic premises to include beliefs about the external world or the past.  However, even this move is inadequate to account for all our knowledge.  In addition to knowing particular facts about the external world or the past we know some general truths about the world such as all crows are black.  It is implausible that this belief is properly basic.  Further, the belief that every observed and unobserved crow is black is not implied by any properly basic belief such as this crow is black.  In addition to moving away from a strong foundationalist theory of non-inferential justification, one must abandon deductivism.

To accommodate knowledge of general truths, philosophers must allow for other kinds of inference beside deductive inference.  The standard form of non-deductive inference is enumerative induction.  Enumerative induction works by listing (that is, enumerating) all the relevant instances and then concluding on the basis of a sufficient sample that all the relevant instances have the target property.  Suppose, for instance, one knows that 100 widgets from the Kenosha Widget Factory have a small k printed on it and that one knows of no counterexamples to this.  Given this knowledge, one can infer by enumerative induction that every widget from the Kenosha Widget Factory has a small k printed on it. Significantly, this inference is liable to mislead.  Perhaps, the widgets one has examined are special in some way that is relevant to the small printed k.  For example, the widgets come from an exclusive series of widgets to celebrate the Kafka’s birthday.  Even though the inference may mislead, it is still intuitively a good inference.  Given a sufficient sample size and no counterexamples, one may infer that the sample is representative of the whole.

The importance of enumerative induction is that it allows one to expand one’s knowledge of the world beyond the foundations.  Moreover, enumerative induction is a form of linear inference.  The premises of the induction are known or justifiedly believed prior to the conclusion being justified believed.  This suggests that enumerative induction is a natural development of the foundationalist conception of knowledge.  Knowledge rests on properly basic beliefs and those other beliefs that can be properly inferred from the best beliefs by deduction and enumerative induction.

iii. Liberal Inductivism

Strict inductivism is motivated by the thought that we have some kind of inferential knowledge of the world that cannot be accommodated by deductive inference from epistemically basic beliefs.  A fairly recent debate has arisen over the merits of strict inductivism.  Some philosophers have argued that there are other forms of non-deductive inference that do not fit the model of enumerative induction.  C.S. Peirce describes a form of inference called “abduction” or “inference to the best explanation.”  This form of inference appeals to explanatory considerations to justify belief.  One infers, for example, that two students copied answers from a third because this is the best explanation of the available data—they each make the same mistakes and the two sat in view of the third.  Alternatively, in a more theoretical context, one infers that there are very small unobservable particles because this is the best explanation of Brownian motion.  Let us call ‘liberal inductivism’ any view that accepts the legitimacy of a form of inference to the best explanation that is distinct from enumerative induction.  For a defense of liberal inductivism see Gilbert Harman’s classic (1965) paper.  Harman defends a strong version of liberal inductivism according to which enumerative induction is just a disguised from of inference to the best explanation.

A crucial task for liberal inductivists is to clarify the criteria that are used to evaluate explanations.  What makes one hypothesis a better explanation than another?  A standard answer is that hypotheses are rated as to their simplicity, testability, scope, fruitfulness, and conservativeness.  The simplicity of a hypothesis is a matter of how many entities, properties, or laws it postulates.  The theory that the streets are wet because it rained last night is simpler than the theory that the streets are wet because there was a massive water balloon fight between the septuagenarians and octogenarians last night.  A hypothesis’s testability is a matter of its ability to be determined to be true or false.  Some hypotheses are more favorable because they can easily be put to the test and when they survive the test, they receive confirmation.  The scope of a hypothesis is a matter of how much data the hypothesis covers.  If two competing hypotheses both entail the fall of the American dollar but another also entails the fact that the Yen rose, the hypothesis that explains this other fact has greater scope.  The fruitfulness of a hypothesis is a matter of how well it can be implemented for new research projects.  Darwin’s theory on the origin of the species has tremendous fruitfulness because, for one, it opened up the study of molecular genetics.  Finally, the conservativeness of a hypothesis is a matter of its fit with our previously accepted theories and beliefs.

The liberal inductivist points to the alleged fact that many of our commonsense judgments about what exists are guided by inference to the best explanation.  If, for instance, we hear the scratching in the walls and witness the disappearance of cheese, we infer that there are mice in the wainscoting.  As the liberal inductivist sees it, this amounts to a primitive use of inference to the best explanation.  The mice hypothesis is relatively simple, testable, and conservative.

The epistemological payout for accepting the legitimacy of inference to the best explanation is significant.  This form of inference is ideally suited for dealing with under-determination cases, cases in which one’s evidence for a hypothesis is compatible with its falsity.  For instance, the evidence we possess for believing that the story of general relativity is correct is compatible with the falsity of that theory.  Nonetheless, we judge that we are rational in believing that general relativity is true based on the available evidence.  The theory of general relativity is the best available explanation of the data.  Similarly, epistemological under-determination arguments focus on the fact that the perceptual data we possess is compatible with the falsity of our common sense beliefs.  If a brain in the vat scenario obtained then one would have all the same sensation states and still believe that, for example, one was seated at a desk.  Nevertheless, the truth of our commonsense beliefs is the best available explanation for the data of sense.  Therefore, our commonsense beliefs meet the justification condition for knowledge.  See Jonathan Vogel (1990) for a response to skepticism along these lines and see Richard Fumerton (1992) for a contrasting perspective.

Liberal inductivism is not without its detractors. Richard Fumerton argues that every acceptable inductive inference is either a straightforward case of induction or a combination of straightforward induction and deduction. Fumerton focuses on paradigm cases of alleged inference to the best explanation and argues that these cases are enthymemes (that is, arguments with suppressed premises).  He considers a case in which someone infers that a person walked recently on the beach from the evidence that there are footprints on the beach and that if a person walked recently on the beach there would be footprints on the beach.  Fumerton observes that this inference fits in to the standard pattern of inference to the best explanation.  However, he then argues that the acceptability of this inference depends on our justification for believing that in the vast majority of cases footprints are produced by people.  Fumerton thus claims that this paradigmatic case of inference to the best explanation is really a disguised form of inference to a particular: the vast majority of footprints are produced by persons; there are footprints on the beach; therefore, a person walked on the beach recently.  The debate of the nature and legitimacy of inference to the best explanation is an active and exciting area of research.  For an excellent discussion and defense of inference to the best explanation see Lipton (2004).

iv. A Theory of Inference and A Theory of Concepts

There are non-trivial connections between a foundationalist theory of inference and theory of concepts.  This is one of the points at which epistemology meets the philosophy of mind.  Both deductivists and strict inductivists tend to accept a thesis about the origin of our concepts.  They both tend to accept the thesis of concept empiricism in which all of our concepts derive from experience.  Following Locke and Hume, concept empiricists stress that we cannot make sense of any ideas that are not based in experience.  Some concept empiricists are strong foundationalists in which case they work with a very limited range of sensory concepts (for example, C.I. Lewis) or they are modest foundationalist in which they take concepts of the external world as disclosed in experience (that is, direct realists).  Concept empiricists are opposed to inference to the best explanation because a characteristic feature of inference to the best explanation is inference to an unobservable.  As the concept empiricist sees it this is illegitimate because we lack the ability to think of genuine non-observables.  For a sophisticated development of this view see Van Fraassen (1980).

Concept rationalists, by contrast, allow that we possess concepts that are not disclosed in experience.  Some concept rationalists, like Descartes, held that some concepts are innate such as the concepts God, substance, or I.  Other concept rationalists view inference to the best explanation as a way of forming new concepts.  In general concept rationalists do not limit the legitimate forms of inference to deduction and enumerative induction.  For a discussion of concept empiricism and rationalism in connection with foundationalism see Timothy McGrew (2003).

5. Conclusion


Foundationalism is a multifaceted doctrine.  A well-worked out foundationalist view needs to naturally combine a theory of non-inferential justification with a view of the nature of inference.  The nature and legitimacy of non-deductive inference is a relatively recent topic and there is hope that significant progress will be made on this score.  Moreover, given the continued interest in the regress problem foundationalism provides to be of perennial interest.  The issues that drive research on foundationalism are fundamental epistemic questions about the structure and legitimacy of our view of the world.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W. 1976a.  “Two Types of Foundationalism.” The Journal of Philosophy 73, 165-185.
  • Alston, W. 1976b.  “Has foundationalism been refuted?” Philosophical Studies 29, 287-305.
  • Armstrong, D.M. 1968. A Materialist Theory of Mind.  New York: Routledge.
  • Audi, R.  The Structure of Justification.  New York: Cambridge.
  • Bergmann, Michael. 2004.  “What’s not wrong with foundationalism,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXVIII, 161-165.
  • Bergmann, Michael. 2006. Justification without Awareness.  New York: Oxford.
  • BonJour, L. 1985.  The Structure of Empirical Knowledge.  Cambridge, MA. Harvard University Press.
  • BonJour, L.  1997.  “Haack on Experience and Justification.”  Synthese 112:1, 13-23.
  • BonJour, L. 1999.  “The Dialectic of Foundationalism and Coherentism.” In The Blackwell Guide to Epistemology eds. John Greco and Ernest Sosa.  Malden, MA: Blackwell, 117-142.
  • BonJour, L and Sosa, E. 2003.  Epistemic Justification: Internalism vs. Externalism, Foundations vs. Virtues. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • Chisholm, R. 1948. “The Problem of Empiricism,” The Journal of Philosophy 45, 512-517.
  • Delaney, C.F. 1976. “Foundations of Empirical Knowledge – Again,” New Scholasticism L, 1-19.
  • Fumerton, R. 1980.  “Induction and Reasoning to the Best Explanation.”  Philosophy of Science 47, 589-600.
  • Fumerton, R. 1992.  “Skepticism and Reasoning to the Best Explanation.”  Philosophical Issues 2, 149-169.
  • Fumerton, R. 1998.  “Replies to My Three Critics.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58, 927-937.
  • Fumerton, R.  2006. “Epistemic Internalism, Philosophical Assurance and the Skeptical Predicament,” in Knowledge and Reality, eds. Crisp, Davidson, and Laan. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 179-191.
  • Fumerton, R. 2009. “Luminous enough for a cognitive home.”  Philosophical Studies 142, 67-76.
  • Goldman, A. 1979.  “What is Justified Belief?” in Justification and knowledge. Eds.  George Pappas.  Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1-23.
  • Haack, S. 1993.  Evidence and Inquiry: Towards Reconstruction in Epistemology. Malden, MA: Blackwell.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1965. “Inference to the Best Explanation.”  The Philosophical Review 74, 88-95.
  • Howard-Snyder, Daniel. 2005.  “Foundationalism and Arbitrariness,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 86, 18-24.
  • Howard-Snyder, D & Coffman, E.J. 2006 “Three Arguments Against Foundationalism: Arbitrariness, Epistemic Regress, and Existential Support,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 36:4, 535-564.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2003.  “Arbitrary Foundations?” The Philosophical Forum XXXIV, 141-152.
  • Klein, Peter.  1999.  “Human knowledge and the regress of reasons,” Philosophical Perspectives 13, 297-325.
  • Klein, Peter. 2004. “What is wrong with foundationalism is that it cannot solve the epistemic regress problem,”  Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXVIII, 166-171.
  • Lehrer, K. 1997.  Self-Trust.  New York: Oxford.
  • Lewis, C.I. 1929.  Mind and the World Order.  New York: Dover Publications.
  • Lewis, C.I.  1952.  “The Given Element in Empirical Knowledge.” The Philosophical Review 61, 168-175.
  • Lipton, P. 2004.  Inference to the Best Explanation 2nd edition.  New York: Routledge.
  • Lycan, W. 1988.  Judgment and Justification.  New York: Cambridge.
  • Lyons, J. 2008.  “Evidence, Experience, and Externalism,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 86, 461-479
  • McGrew, T. 2003. “A Defense of Classical Foundationalism,” in The Theory of Knowledge, ed. Louis Pojman, Belmont: CA. Wadsworth, pp. 194-206.
  • Meeker, K & Poston, T.  2010.  “Skeptics without Borders.”  American Philosophical Quarterly 47:3, 223-237.
  • Neurath, Otto.  1959.  “Protocol Sentences.” In Logical Positivism ed. A.J. Ayer Free Press, New York, 199-208.
  • Nozick, R. 1981.  Philosophical Explanations.  Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Pastin, M. 1975a. “C.I. Lewis’s Radical Foundationalism” Nous 9, 407-420.
  • Pastin, M. 1975b. “Modest Foundationalism and Self-Warrant,” American Philosophical Quarterly 4, 141-149.
  • Plantinga, A. 1983.  “Reason and Belief in God,” in Faith and Rationality. Eds. Alvin Plantinga and Nicholas Wolterstorff.  Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Plantinga, A. 1993.  Warrant: The Current Debate.  New York: Oxford.
  • Plantinga, A. 2000.  Warranted Christian Belief.  New York: Oxford.
  • Pollock, J and Cruz, J. 1999.  Contemporary Theories of Knowledge 2nd edition.  New York: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Pryor, J. 2000.  “The Skeptic and the Dogmatist.”  Nous 34, 517-549.
  • Pryor, J. 2001. “Highlights of Recent Epistemology,” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 52, 95-124.
    • Stresses that modest foundationalism looks better in 2001 than it looked circa 1976.
  • Quine. W.V.O.  1951. “Two Dogmas of Empiricism.”  The Philosophical Review 60, 20-43.
  • Rescher, N. 1973.  The Coherence Theory of Truth.  New York: Oxford.
  • Russell, B. 1948.  Human Knowledge.  New York: Routledge.
  • Schlick, Moritz. 1959.  “The Foundation of Knowledge.” In Logical Positivism ed. A.J. Ayer Free Press, New York, 209-227.
  • Sellars, Wilfrid. 1963.  “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind,” in Science, Perception, and Reality.  Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Co, pp. 127-196.
  • Triplett, Timm. 1990. “Recent work on Foundationalism,” American Philosophical Quarterly 27:2, 93-116.
  • van Cleve, James. 2005.  "Why Coherence is Not Enough:  A Defense of Moderate Foundationalism,” in Contemporary Debates in Epistemology, edited by Matthias Steup and Ernest Sosa. Oxford:  Blackwell, pp. 168-80.
  • van Fraassen, Bas. 1980.  The Scientific Image.  New York: Oxford.
  • Vogel, Jonathan. 1990.  “Cartesian Skepticism and Inference to the Best Explanation.”  The Journal of Philosophy 87, 658-666.

Author Information

Ted Poston
Email: poston “at”
University of South Alabama
U. S. A.


Connectionism is an approach to the study of human cognition that utilizes mathematical models, known as connectionist networks or artificial neural networks.  Often, these come in the form of highly interconnected, neuron-like processing units. There is no sharp dividing line between connectionism and computational neuroscience, but connectionists tend more often to abstract away from the specific details of neural functioning to focus on high-level cognitive processes (for example, recognition, memory, comprehension, grammatical competence and reasoning). During connectionism's ideological heyday in the late twentieth century, its proponents aimed to replace theoretical appeals to formal rules of inference and sentence-like cognitive representations with appeals to the parallel processing of diffuse patterns of neural activity.

Connectionism was pioneered in the 1940s and had attracted a great deal of attention by the 1960s. However, major flaws in the connectionist modeling techniques were soon revealed, and this led to reduced interest in connectionist research and reduced funding.  But in  the 1980s  connectionism underwent a potent, permanent revival. During the later part of the twentieth century, connectionism would be touted by many as the brain-inspired replacement for the computational artifact-inspired 'classical' approach to the study of cognition. Like classicism, connectionism attracted and inspired a major cohort of naturalistic philosophers, and the two broad camps clashed over whether or not connectionism had the wherewithal to resolve central quandaries concerning minds, language, rationality and knowledge. More recently, connectionist techniques and concepts have helped inspire philosophers and scientists who maintain that human and non-human cognition is best explained without positing inner representations of the world. Indeed, connectionist techniques are now very widely embraced, even if few label themselves connectionists anymore. This is an indication of connectionism’s success.

Table of Contents

  1. McCulloch and Pitts
  2. Parts and Properties of Connectionist Networks
  3. Learning Algorithms
    1. Hebb’s Rule
    2. The Delta Rule
    3. The Generalized Delta Rule
  4. Connectionist Models Aplenty
    1. Elman’s Recurrent Nets
    2. Interactive Architectures
  5. Making Sense of Connectionist Processing
  6. Connectionism and the Mind
    1. Rules versus General Learning Mechanisms: The Past-Tense Controversy
    2. Concepts
    3. Connectionism and Eliminativism
    4. Classicists on the Offensive: Fodor and Pylyshyn’s Critique
      1. Reason
      2. Productivity and Systematicity
  7. Anti-Represenationalism: Dynamical Stystems Theory, A-Life and Embodied Cognition
  8. Where Have All the Connectionists Gone?
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. References
    2. Connectionism Freeware

1. McCulloch and Pitts

In 1943, neurophysiologist Warren McCulloch and a young logician named Walter Pitts demonstrated that neuron-like structures (or units, as they were called) that act and interact purely on the basis of a few neurophysiologically plausible principles could be wired together and thereby be given the capacity to perform complex logical calculation (McCulloch & Pitts 1943). They began by noting that the activity of neurons has an all-or-none character to it – that is, neurons are either ‘firing’ electrochemical impulses down their lengthy projections (axons) towards junctions with other neurons (synapses) or they are inactive. They also noted that in order to become active, the net amount of excitatory influence from other neurons must reach a certain threshold and that some neurons must inhibit others. These principles can be described by mathematical formalisms, which allows for calculation of the unfolding behaviors of networks obeying such principles. McCulloch and Pitts capitalized on these facts to prove that neural networks are capable of performing a variety of logical calculations. For instance, a network of three units can be configured so as to compute the fact that a conjunction (that is, two complete statements connected by ‘and’) will be true only if both component statements are true (Figure 1). Other logical operations involving disjunctions (two statements connected by ‘or’) and negations can also be computed. McCulloch and Pitts showed how more complex logical calculations can be performed by combining the networks for simpler calculations. They even proposed that a properly configured network supplied with infinite tape (for storing information) and a read-write assembly (for recording and manipulating that information) would be capable of computing whatever any given Turing machine (that is, a machine that can compute any computable function) can.

Figure 1: Conjunction Network We may interpret the top (output) unit as representing the truth value of a conjunction (that is, activation value 1 = true and 0 = false) and the bottom two (input) units as representing the truth values of each conjunct. The input units each have an excitatory connection to the output unit, but for the output unit to activate the sum of the input unit activations must still exceed a certain threshold. The threshold is set high enough to ensure that the output unit becomes active just in case both input units are activated simultaneously. Here we see a case where only one input unit is active, and so the output unit is inactive. A disjunction network can be constructed by lowering the threshold so that the output unit will become active if either input unit is fully active. [Created using Simbrain 2.0]

Somewhat ironically, these proposals were a major source of inspiration for John von Neumann’s work demonstrating how a universal Turing machine can be created out of electronic components (vacuum tubes, for example) (Franklin & Garzon 1996, Boden 2006). Von Neumann’s work yielded what is now a nearly ubiquitous programmable computing architecture that bears his name. The advent of these electronic computing devices and the subsequent development of high-level programming languages greatly hastened the ascent of the formal classical approach to cognition, inspired by formal logic and based on sentence and rule (see Artificial Intelligence). Then again, electronic computers were also needed to model the behaviors of complicated neural networks.

For their part, McCulloch and Pitts had the foresight to see that the future of artificial neural networks lay not with their ability to implement formal computations, but with their ability to engage in messier tasks like recognizing distorted patterns and solving problems requiring the satisfaction of multiple 'soft' constraints. However, before we get to these developments, we should consider in a bit more detail some of the basic operating principles of typical connectionist networks.

2. Parts and Properties of Connectionist Networks

Connectionist networks are made up of interconnected processing units which can take on a range of numerical activation levels (for example, a value ranging from 0 – 1). A given unit may have incoming connections from, or outgoing connections to, many other units. The excitatory or inhibitory strength (or weight) of each connection is determined by its positive or negative numerical value. The following is a typical equation for computing the influence of one unit on another:

Influenceiu = ai * wiu

This says that for any unit i and any unit u to which it is connected, the influence of i on u is equal to the product of the activation value of i and the weight of the connection from i to u. Thus, if ai = 1 and wiu = .02, then the influence of i on u will be 0.02. If a unit has inputs from multiple units, the net influence of those units will just be the sum of these individual influences.

One common sort of connectionist system is the two-layer feed-forward network. In these networks, units are segregated into discrete input and output layers such that connections run only from the former to the latter. Often, every input unit will be connected to every output unit, so that a network with 100 units, for instance, in each layer will possess 10,000 inter-unit connections. Let us suppose that in a network of this very sort each input unit is randomly assigned an activation level of 0 or 1 and each weight is randomly set to a level between -0.01 to 0.01. In this case, the activation level of each output unit will be determined by two factors: the net influence of the input units; and the degree to which the output unit is sensitive to that influence, something which is determined by its activation function. One common activation function is the step function, which sets a very sharp threshold. For instance, if the threshold on a given output unit were set through a step function at 0.65, the level of activation for that unit under different amounts of net input could be graphed out as follows:

Figure 2: Step Activation Function

Thus, if the input units have a net influence of 0.7, the activation function returns a value of 1 for the output unit’s activation level. If they had a net influence of 0.2, the output level would be 0, and so on. Another common activation that has more of a sigmoid shape to it – that is, graphed out it looks something like this:

Figure 3: Sigmoid Activation Function

Thus, if our net input were 0.7, the output unit would take on an activation value somewhere near 0.9.

Now, suppose that a modeler set the activation values across the input units (that is, encodes an input vector) of our 200 unit network so that some units take on an activation level of 1 and others take on a value of 0. In order to determine what the value of a single output unit would be, one would have to perform the procedure just described (that is, calculate the net influence and pass it through an activation function). To determine what the entire output vector would be, one must repeat the procedure for all 100 output units.

As discussed earlier, the truth-value of a statement can be encoded in terms of a unit’s activation level. There are, however, countless other sorts of information that can be encoded in terms of unit activation levels. For instance, the activation level of each input unit might represent the presence or absence of a different animal characteristic (say, “has hooves,” “swims,” or “has fangs,”) whereas each output unit represents a particular kind of animal (“horse,” “pig,” or “dog,”). Our goal might be to construct a model that correctly classifies animals on the basis of their features. We might begin by creating a list (a corpus) that contains, for each animal, a specification of the appropriate input and output vectors. The challenge is then to set the weights on the connections so that when one of these input vectors is encoded across the input units, the network will activate the appropriate animal unit at the output layer. Setting these weights by hand would be quite tedious given that our network has 10000 weighted connections. Researchers would discover, however, that the process of weight assignment can be automated.

3. Learning Algorithms

a. Hebb’s Rule

The next major step in connectionist research came on the heels of neurophysiologist Donald Hebb’s (1949) proposal that the connection between two biological neurons is strengthened (that is, the presynaptic neuron will come to have an even stronger excitatory influence) when both neurons are simultaneously active.  As it is often put, “neurons that fire together, wire together.” This principle would be expressed by a mathematical formula which came to be known as Hebb’s rule:

Change of weightiu = ai * au * lrate

The rule states that the weight on a connection from input unit i to output unit u is to be changed by an amount equal to the product of the activation value of i, the activation value of u, and a learning rate. [Notice that a large learning rate conduces to large weight changes and a smaller learning rate to more gradual changes.] Hebb’s rule gave connectionist models the capacity to modify the weights on their own connections in light of the input-output patterns it has encountered.

Let us suppose, for the sake of illustration, that our 200 unit network started out life with connection weights of 0 across the board. We might then take an entry from our corpus of input-output pairs (say, the entry for donkeys) and set the input and output values accordingly. Hebb’s rule might then be employed to strengthen connections from active input units to active output units. [Note: if units are allowed to have weights that vary between positive and negative values (for example, between -1 and 1), then Hebb’s rule will strengthen connections between units whose activation values have the same sign and weaken connections between units with different signs.] This procedure could then be repeated for each entry in the corpus. Given a corpus of 100 entries and at 10,000 applications of the rule per entry, a total of 1,000,000 applications of the rule would be required for just one pass through the corpus (called an epoch of training). Here, clearly, the powerful number-crunching capabilities of electronic computers become essential.

Let us assume that we have set the learning rate to a relatively high value and that the network has received one epoch of training. What we will find is that if a given input pattern from the training corpus is encoded across the input units, activity will propagate forward through the connections in such a way as to activate the appropriate output unit. That is, our network will have learned how to appropriately classify input patterns.

As a point of comparison, the mainstream approach to artificial intelligence (AI) research is basically an offshoot of traditional forms of computer programming. Computer programs manipulate sentential representations by applying rules which are sensitive to the syntax (roughly, the shape) of those sentences. For instance, a rule might be triggered at a certain point in processing because a certain input was presented – say, “Fred likes broccoli and Sam likes cauliflower.” The rule might be triggered whenever a compound sentence of the form p and q is input and it might produce as output a sentence of the form p (“Fred likes broccoli”). Although this is a vast oversimplification, it does highlight a distinctive feature of the classical approach to AI, which is the assumption that cognition is effected through the application of syntax-sensitive rules to syntactically structured representations. What is distinctive about many connectionist systems is that they encode information through activation vectors (and weight vectors), and they process that information when activity propagates forward through many weighted connections.

In addition, insofar as connectionist processing is in this way highly distributed (that is, many processors and connections simultaneously shoulder a bit of the processing load), a network will often continue to function even if part of it gets destroyed (if connections are pruned). The same kind of parallel and distributed processing (where many processors and connections are shouldering a bit of the processing load simultaneously) that enables this kind of graceful degradation also allows connectionist systems to respond sensibly to noisy or otherwise imperfect inputs. For instance, even we encoded an input vector that deviated from the one  for donkeys but was still closer to the donkey vector than to any other, our model would still likely classify it as a donkey. Traditional forms of computer programming, on the other hand, have a much greater tendency to fail or completely crash due to even minor imperfections in either programming code or inputs.

The advent of connectionist learning rules was clearly a watershed event in the history of connectionism. It made possible the automation of vast numbers of weight assignments, and this would eventually enable connectionist systems to perform feats that McCulloch and Pitts could scarcely have imagined. As a learning rule for feed-forward networks, however, Hebb’s rule faces severe limitations. Particularly damaging is the fact that the learning of one input-output pair (an association) will in many cases disrupt what a network has already learned about other associations, a process known as catastrophic interference. Another problem is that although a set of weights oftentimes exists that would allow a network to perform a given pattern association task, oftentimes its discovery is beyond the capabilities of Hebb’s rule.

b. The Delta Rule

Such shortcomings led researchers to investigate new learning rules, one of the most important being the delta rule. To train our network using the delta rule, we it out with random weights and feed it a particular input vector from the corpus. Activity then propagates forward to the output layer. Afterwards, for a given unit u at the output layer, the network takes the actual activation of u and its desired activation and modifies weights according to the following rule:

Change of weightiu = learning rate * (desiredu - au) * ai

That is, to modify a connection from input i to output u, the delta rule computes the product of the difference between the desired activation of u and the actual activation (the error score), the activation of i, and a (typically very small) learning rate. Thus, assuming that unit u should be fully active (but is not) and input i happens to be highly active, the delta rule will increase the strength of the connection from i to u. This will make it more likely that the next time i is highly active, u will be too. If, on the other hand, u should have been inactive but was not, the connection from i to u will be pushed in a negative direction. As with Hebb’s rule, when an input pattern is presented during training, the delta rule is used to calculate how the weights from each input unit to a given output unit are to be modified, a procedure repeated for each output unit. The next item on the corpus is then input to the network and the process repeats, until the entire corpus (or at least that part of it that the researchers want the network to encounter) has been run through. Unlike Hebb’s rule, the delta rule typically makes small weight changes, meaning that several epochs of training may be required before a network achieves competent performance. Again unlike Hebb’s rule, however,  the delta rule will in principle always slowly converge on a set of weights that will allow for mastery of all associations in a corpus, provided that such a set of weights exists. Famed connectionist Frank Rosenblatt called networks of the sort lately discussed perceptrons. He also proved the foregoing truth about them, which became known as the perceptron convergence theorem.

Rosenblatt believed that his work with perceptrons constituted a radical departure from, and even spelled the beginning of the end of, logic-based classical accounts of information processing (1958, 449; see also Bechtel & Abrahamson 2002, 6). Rosenblatt was very much concerned with the abstract information-processing powers of connectionist systems, but others, like Oliver Selfridge (1959), were investigating the ability of connectionist systems to perform specific cognitive tasks, such as recognizing handwritten letters. Connectionist models began around this time to be implemented with the aid of Von Neumann devices, which, for reasons already mentioned, proved to be a blessing.

There was much exuberance associated with connectionism during this period, but it would not last long. Many point to the publication of Perceptrons by prominent classical AI researchers Marvin Minsky and Seymour Papert (1969) as the pivotal event. Minsky and Papert showed (among other things) that perceptrons cannot learn some sets of associations. The simplest of these is a mapping from truth values of statements p and q to the truth value of p XOR q (where p XOR q is true, just in case p is true or q is true but not both). No set of weights will enable a simple two-layer feed-forward perceptron to compute the XOR function. The fault here lies largely with the architecture, for feed-forward networks with one or more layers of hidden units intervening between input and output layers (see Figure 4) can be made to perform the sorts of mappings that troubled Minsky and Papert. However, these critics also speculated that three-layer networks could never be trained to converge upon the correct set of weights. This dealt connectionists a serious setback, for it helped to deprive connectionists of the AI research funds being doled out by the Defense Advanced Research Projects Agency (DARPA). Connectionists found themselves at a major competitive disadvantage, leaving classicists with the field largely to themselves for over a decade.

c. The Generalized Delta Rule

In the 1980s, as classical AI research was hitting doldrums of its own, connectionism underwent a powerful resurgence thanks to the advent of the generalized delta rule (Rumelhart, Hinton, & Williams 1986). This rule, which is still the backbone of contemporary connectionist research, enables networks with one or more layers of hidden units to learn how to perform sets of input-output mappings of the sort that troubled Minsky and Papert. The simpler delta rule (discussed above) uses an error score (the difference between the actual activation level of an output unit and its desired activation level) and the incoming unit’s activation level to determine how much to alter a given weight. The generalized delta rule works roughly the same way for the layer of connections running from the final layer of hidden units to the output units. For a connection running into a hidden unit, the rule calculates how much the hidden unit contributed to the total error signal (the sum of the individual output unit error signals) rather than the error signal of any particular unit.  It adjust the connection from a unit in a still earlier layer to that hidden unit based upon the activity of the former and based upon the latter’s contribution to the total error score. This process can be repeated for networks of varying depth. Put differently, the generalized delta rule enables backpropagation learning, where an error signal propagates backwards through multiple layers in order to guide weight modifications.

Figure 4: Three-layer Network [Created using Simbrain 2.0]

4. Connectionist Models Aplenty

Connectionism sprang back onto the scene in 1986 with a monumental two-volume compendium of connectionist modeling techniques (volume 1) and models of psychological processes (volume 2) by David Rumelhart, James McClelland and their colleagues in the Parallel Distributed Processing (PDP) research group. Each chapter of the second volume describes a connectionist model of some particular cognitive process along with a discussion of how the model departs from earlier ways of understanding that process. It included models of schemata (large scale data structures), speech recognition, memory, language comprehension, spatial reasoning and past-tense learning. Alongside this compendium, and in its wake, came a deluge of further models.

Although this new breed of connectionism was occasionally lauded as marking the next great paradigm shift in cognitive science, mainstream connectionist research has not tended to be directed at overthrowing previous ways of thinking. Rather, connectionists seem more interested in offering a deeper look at facets of cognitive processing that have already been recognized and studied in disciplines like cognitive psychology, cognitive neuropsychology and cognitive neuroscience. What are highly novel are the claims made by connectionists about the precise form of internal information processing. Before getting to those claims, let us first discuss a few other connectionist architectures.

a. Elman’s Recurrent Nets

Over the course of his investigation into whether or not a connectionist system can learn to master the complicated grammatical principles of a natural language such as English, Jeffrey Elman (1990) helped to pioneer a powerful, new connectionist architecture, sometimes known as an Elman net. This work posed a direct challenge to Chomsky’s proposal that humans are born with an innate language acquisition device, one that comes preconfigured with vast knowledge of the space of possible grammatical principles. One of Chomsky’s main arguments against Skinner’s behaviorist theory of language-learning was that no general learning principles could enable humans to produce and comprehend a limitless number of grammatical sentences. Although connectionists had attempted (for example, with the aid of finite state grammars) to show that human languages could be mastered by general learning devices, sentences containing multiple center-embedded clauses (“The cats the dog chases run away,” for instance) proved a major stumbling block. To produce and understand such a sentence requires one to be able to determine subject-verb agreements across the boundaries of multiple clauses by attending to contextual cues presented over time. All of this requires a kind of memory for preceding context that standard feed-forward connectionist systems lack.

Elman’s solution was to incorporate a side layer of context units that receive input from and send output back to a hidden unit layer. In its simplest form, an input is presented to the network and activity propagates forward to the hidden layer. On the next step (or cycle) of processing, the hidden unit vector propagates forward through weighted connections to generate an output vector while at the same time being copied onto a side layer of context units. When the second input is presented (the second word in a sentence, for example), the new hidden layer activation is the product of both this second input and activity in the context layer – that is, the hidden unit vector now contains information about both the current input and the preceding one. The hidden unit vector then produces an output vector as well as a new context vector. When the third item is input, a new hidden unit vector is produced that contains information about all of the previous time steps, and so on. This process provides Elman’s networks with time-dependent contextual information of the sort required for language-processing. Indeed, his networks are able to form highly accurate predictions regarding which words and word forms are permissible in a given context, including those that involve multiple embedded clauses.

While Chomsky (1993) has continued to self-consciously advocate a shift back towards the nativist psychology of the rationalists, Elman and other connectionists have at least bolstered the plausibility of a more austere empiricist approach. Connectionism is, however, much more than a simple empiricist associationism, for it is at least compatible with a more complex picture of internal dynamics. For one thing, to maintain consistency with the findings of mainstream neuropsychology, connectionists ought to (and one suspects that most do) allow that we do not begin life with a uniform, amorphous cognitive mush. Rather, as mentioned earlier, the cognitive load may be divided among numerous, functionally distinct components. Moreover, even individual feed-forward networks are often tasked with unearthing complicated statistical patterns exhibited in large amounts of data. An indication of just how complicated a process this can be, the task of analyzing how it is that connectionist systems manage to accomplish the impressive things that they do has turned out to be a major undertaking unto itself (see Section 5).

b. Interactive Architectures

There are, it is important to realize, connectionist architectures that do not incorporate the kinds of feed-forward connections upon which we have so far concentrated. For instance, McClelland and Rumelhart's (1989) interactive activation and competition (IAC) architecture and its many variants utilize excitatory and inhibitory connections that run back and forth between the units in different groups. In IAC models, weights are hard-wired rather than learned and units are typically assigned their own particular, fixed meanings. When a set of units is activated so as to encode some piece of information, activity may shift around a bit, but as units compete with one another to become most active through inter-unit inhibitory connections activity will eventually settle into a stable state. The stable state may be viewed, depending upon the process being modeled, as the network's reaction to the stimulus, which, depending upon the process being modeled, might be viewed as a semantic interpretation, a classification or a mnemonic association. The IAC architecture has proven particularly effective at modeling phenomena associated with long-term memory (content addressability, priming and language comprehension, for instance). The connection weights in IAC models can be set in various ways, including on the basis of individual hand selection, simulated evolution or statistical analysis of naturally occurring data (for example, co-occurrence of words in newspapers or encyclopedias (Kintsch 1998)).

An architecture that incorporates similar competitive processing principles, with the added twist that it allows weights to be learned, is the self-organizing feature map (SOFM) (see Kohonen 1983; see also Miikkulainen 1993). SOFMs learn to map complicated input vectors onto the individual units of a two-dimensional array of units. Unlike feed-forward systems that are supplied with information about the correct output for a given input, SOFMs learn in an unsupervised manner. Training consists simply in presenting the model with numerous input vectors. During training the network adjusts its inter-unit weights so that both each unit is highly ‘tuned’ to a specific input vector and the two-dimensional array is divided up in ways that reflect the most salient groupings of vectors. In principle, nothing more complicated than a Hebbian learning algorithm is required to train most SOFMs. After training, when an input pattern is presented, competition yields a single clear winner (for example, the most highly active unit), which is called the system’s image (or interpretation) of that input.

SOFMs were coming into their own even during the connectionism drought of the 1970s, thanks in large part to Finnish researcher Tuevo Kohonen. Ultimately it was found that with proper learning procedures, trained SOFMs exhibit a number of biologically interesting features that will be familiar to anyone who knows a bit about topographic maps (for example, retinotopic, tonotopic and somatotopic) in the mammalian cortex. SOFMs tend not to allow a portion of the map go unused; they represent similar input vectors with neighboring units, which collectively amount to a topographic map of the space of input vectors; and if a training corpus contains many similar input vectors, the portion of the map devoted to the task of discriminating between them will expand, resulting in a map with a distorted topography. SOFMs have even been used to model the formation of retinotopically organized columns of contour detectors found in the primary visual cortex (Goodhill 1993). SOFMs thus reside somewhere along the upper end of the biological-plausibility continuum.

Here we have encountered just a smattering of connectionist learning algorithms and architectures, which continue to evolve. Indeed, despite what in some quarters has been a protracted and often heated debate between connectionists and classicists (discussed below), many researchers are content to move back and forth between, and also to merge, the two approaches depending upon the task at hand.

5. Making Sense of Connectionist Processing

Connectionist systems generally learn by detecting complicated statistical patterns present in huge amounts of data. This often requires detection of complicated cues as to the proper response to a given input, the salience of which often varies with context. This can make it difficult to determine precisely how a given connectionist system utilizes its units and connections to accomplish the goals set for it.

One common way of making sense of the workings of connectionist systems is to view them at a coarse, rather than fine, grain of analysis -- to see them as concerned with the relationships between different activation vectors, not individual units and weighted connections. Consider, for instance, how a fully trained Elman network learns how to process particular words. Typically nouns like “ball,” “boy,” “cat,” and “potato” will produce hidden unit activation vectors that are more similar to one another (they tend to cluster together) than they are to “runs,” “ate,” and “coughed”. Moreover, the vectors for “boy” and “cat” will tend to be more similar to each other than either is to the “ball” or “potato” vectors. One way of determining that this is the case is to begin by conceiving activation vectors as points within a space that has as many dimensions as there are units. For instance, the activation levels of two units might be represented as a single point in a two-dimensional plane where the y axis represents the value of the first unit and the x axis represents the second unit. This is called the state space for those units. Thus, if there are two units whose activation values are 0.2 and 0.7, this can be represented as the point where these two values intersect (Figure 5).

Figure 5: Activation of Two Units Plotted as Point in 2-D State Space

The activation levels of three units can be represented as the point in a cube where the three values intersect, and so on for other numbers of units. Of course, there is a limit to the number of dimensions we can depict or visualize, but there is no limit to the number of dimensions we can represent algebraically. Thus, even where many units are involved, activation vectors can be represented as points in high-dimensional space and the similarity of two vectors can be determined by measuring the proximity of those points in high-dimensional state space. This, however, tells us nothing about the way context determines the specific way in which networks represent particular words. Other techniques (for example, principal components analysis and multidimensional scaling) have been employed to understand such subtleties as the context-sensitive time-course of processing.

One of the interesting things revealed about connectionist systems through these sorts of techniques has been that networks which share the same connection structure but begin training with different random starting weights will often learn to perform a given task equally well and to do so by partitioning hidden unit space in similar ways. For instance, the clustering in Elman’s models discussed above will likely obtain for different networks even though they have very different weights and activities at the level of individual connections and units.

At this point, we are also in a good position to understand some differences in how connectionist networks code information. In the simplest case, a particular unit will represent a particular piece of information – for instance, our hypothetical network about animals uses particular units to represent particular features of animals. This is called a localist encoding scheme. In other cases an entire collection of activation values is taken to represents something – for instance, an entire input vector of our hypothetical animal classification network might represent the characteristics of a particular animal. This is a distributed coding scheme at the whole animal level, but still a local encoding scheme at the feature level. When we turn to hidden-unit representations, however, things are often quite different. Hidden-unit representations of inputs are often distributed without employing localist encoding at the level of individual units. That is, particular hidden units often fail to have any particular input feature that they are exclusively sensitive to. Rather, they participate in different ways in the processing of many different kinds of input. This is called coarse coding, and there are ways of coarse coding input and output patterns as well. The fact that connectionist networks excel at forming and processing these highly distributed representations is one of their most distinctive and important features.

Also important is that connectionist models often excel at processing novel input patterns (ones not encountered during training) appropriately. Successful performance of a task will often generalize to other related tasks. This is because connectionist models often work by detecting statistical patterns present in a corpus (of input-output pairs, for instance). They learn to process particular inputs in particular ways, and when they encounter inputs similar to those encountered during training they process them in a similar manner. For instance, Elman’s networks were trained to determine which words and word forms to expect given a particular context (for example, “The boy threw the ______”). After training, they could do this very well even for sentence parts they ha not encountered before. One caveat here is that connectionist systems with numerous hidden units (relative to the amount of variability in the training corpus) tend to use the extra memory to ‘remember by rote’ how to treat specific input patterns rather than discerning more abstract statistical patterns obtaining across many different input-output vectors. Consequently, in such cases performance tends not to generalize to novel cases very well.

As we have seen, connectionist networks have a number of desirable features from a cognitive modeling standpoint. There are, however, also serious concerns about connectionism. One is that connectionist models must usually undergo a great deal of training on many different inputs in order to perform a task and exhibit adequate generalization. In many instances, however, we can form a permanent memory (upon being told of a loved one’s passing, for example) with zero repetition (this was also a major blow to the old psychological notion that rehearsal is required for a memory to make it into long-term storage). Nor is there much need to fear that subsequent memories will overwrite earlier ones, a process known in connectionist circles as catastrophic interference. We can also very quickly detect patterns in stimuli (for instance, the pattern exhibited by “J, M, P…”) and apply them to new stimuli (for example, “7, 10, 13…”). Unfortunately, many (though not all) connectionist networks (namely many back-propagation networks) fail to exhibit one-shot learning and are prone to catastrophic interference.

Another worry about back-propagation networks is that the generalized delta rule is, biologically speaking, implausible. It certainly does look that way so far, but even if the criticism hits the mark we should bear in mind the difference between computability theory questions and learning theory questions. In the case of connectionism, questions of the former sort concern what sorts of things connectionist systems can and cannot do and questions of the latter address how connectionist systems might come to learn (or evolve) the ability to do these things. The back-propagation algorithm makes the networks that utilize them implausible from the perspective of learning theory, not computability theory. It should, in other words, be viewed as a major accomplishment when a connectionist network that utilizes only biologically plausible processing principles (, activation thresholds and weighted connections) is able to perform a cognitive task that had hitherto seemed mysterious. It constitutes a biologically plausible model of the underlying mechanisms regardless of whether or not it came possess that structure through hand-selection of weights, Hebbian learning, back-propagation or simulated evolution.

6. Connectionism and the Mind

The classical conception of cognition was deeply entrenched in philosophy (namely in empirically oriented philosophy of mind) and cognitive science when the connectionist program was resurrected in the 1980s. Nevertheless, many researchers flocked to connectionism, feeling that it held much greater promise and that it might revamp our common-sense conception of ourselves. During the early days of the ensuing controversy, the differences between connectionist and classical models of cognition seemed to be fairly stark. Connectionist networks learned how to engage in the parallel processing of highly distributed representations and were fault tolerant because of it. Classical systems were vulnerable to catastrophic failure due to their reliance upon the serial application of syntax-sensitive rules to syntactically structured (sentence-like) representations. Connectionist systems superimposed many kinds of information across their units and weights, whereas classical systems stored separate pieces of information in distinct memory registers and accessed them in serial fashion on the basis of their numerical addresses.

Perhaps most importantly, connectionism promised to bridge low-level neuroscience and high-level psychology. Classicism, by contrast, lent itself to dismissive views about the relevance of neuroscience to psychology. It helped spawn the idea that cognitive processes can be realized by any of countless distinct physical substrates (see Multiple Realizability). The basic idea here is that if the mind is just a program being run by the brain, the material substrate through which the program is instantiated drops out as irrelevant. After all, computationally identical computers can be made out of neurons, vacuum tubes, microchips, pistons and gears, and so forth, which means that computer programs can be run on highly heterogeneous machines. Neural nets are but one of these types, and so they are of no essential relevance to psychology. On the connectionist view, by contrast, human cognition can only be understood by paying considerable attention to kind of physical mechanism that instantiates it.

Although these sorts of differences seemed fairly stark in the early days of the connectionism-classicism debate, proponents of the classical conception have recently made great progress emulating the aforementioned virtues of connectionist processing. For instance, classical systems have been implemented with a high degree of redundancy, through the action of many processors working in parallel, and by incorporating fuzzier rules to allow for input variability. In these ways, classical systems can be endowed with a much higher level of fault and noise tolerance, not to mention processing speed (See Bechtel & Abrahamson 2002). We should also not lose sight of the fact that classical systems have virtually always been capable of learning. They have, in particular, long excelled at learning new ways to efficiently search branching problem spaces. That said, connectionist systems seem to have a very different natural learning aptitude – namely, they excel at picking up on complicated patterns, sub-patterns, and exceptions, and apparently without the need for syntax-sensitive inference rules. This claim has, however, not gone uncontested.

a. Rules versus General Learning Mechanisms: The Past-Tense Controversy

Rumelhart and McClelland’s (1986) model of past-tense learning has long been at the heart of this particular controversy. What these researchers claimed to have shown was that over the course of learning how to produce past-tense forms of verbs, their connectionist model naturally exhibited the same distinctive u-shaped learning curve as children. Of particular interest was the fact that early in the learning process children come to generate the correct past-tense forms of a number of verbs, mostly irregulars (“go” → “went”). Later, performance drops precipitously as they pick up on certain fairly general principles (for example, adding “-ed”) and over-apply them even to previously learned irregulars (“went” may become “goed”). Lastly, performance increases as the child learns both the rules and their exceptions.

What Rumelhart and McClelland (1986) attempted to show was that this sort of process need not be underwritten by mechanisms that work by applying physically and functionally distinct rules to representations. Instead, all of the relevant information can be stored in superimposed fashion within the weights of a connectionist network (really three of them linked end-to-end). Pinker and Prince (1988), however, would charge (inter alia) that the picture of linguistic processing painted by Rumelhart and McClelland was extremely simplistic and that their training corpus was artificially structured (namely, that the proportion of regular to irregular verbs varied unnaturally over the course of training) so as to elicit u-shaped learning. Plunkett and Marchman (1993) went a long way towards remedying the second apparent defect, though Marcus (1995) complained that they did not go far enough since the proportion of regular to irregular verbs was still not completely homogenous throughout training. As with most of the major debates constituting the broader connectionist-classicist controversy, this one has yet to be conclusively resolved. Nevertheless, it seems clear that this line of connectionist research does at least suggest something of more general importance – namely, that an interplay between a structured environment and general associative learning mechanisms might in principle conspire so as to yield complicated behaviors of the sort that lead some researchers to posit inner classical process.

b. Concepts

Some connectionists also hope to challenge the classical account of concepts, which embody knowledge of categories and kinds. It has long been widely held that concepts specify the singularly necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for category membership – for instance, “bachelor” might be said to apply to all and only unmarried, eligible males. Membership conditions of this sort would give concepts a sharp, all-or-none character, and they naturally lend themselves to instantiation in terms of formal inference rules and sentential representations. However, as Wittgenstein (1953) pointed out, many words (for example, “game”) seem to lack these sorts of strict membership criteria. Instead, their referents bear a much looser family resemblance relation to one another. Rosch & Mervis (1975) later provided apparent experimental support for the related idea that our knowledge of categories is organized not in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions but rather in terms of clusters of features, some of which (namely those most frequently encountered in category members) are more strongly associated with the category than others. For instance, the ability to fly is more frequently encountered in birds than is the ability to swim, though neither ability is common to all birds. On the prototype view (and also on the closely related exemplar view), category instances are thought of as clustering together in what might be thought of as a hyper-dimensional semantic space (a space in which there are as many dimensions as there are relevant features). In this space, the prototype is the central region around which instances cluster (exemplar theory essentially does away with this abstract region, allowing only for memory of actual concrete instances). There are clearly significant isomorphisms between concepts conceived of in this way and the kinds of hyper-dimensional clusters of hidden unit representations formed by connectionist networks, and so the two approaches are often viewed as natural allies (Horgan & Tienson 1991). This way of thinking about concepts has, of course, not gone unchallenged (see Rey 1983 and Barsalou 1987 for two very different responses).

c. Connectionism and Eliminativism

Neuroscientist Patricia Churchland and philosopher Paul Churchland have argued that connectionism has done much to weaken the plausibility of our pre-scientific conception of mental processes (our folk psychology). Like other prominent figures in the debate regarding connectionism and folk psychology, the Churchlands appear to be heavily influenced by Wilfrid Sellars’ view that folk psychology is a theory that enables predictions and explanations of everyday behaviors, a theory that posits internal manipulation to the sentence-like representations of the things that we believe and desire. The classical conception of cognition is, accordingly, viewed as a natural spinoff of this folk theory. The Churchlands maintain that neither the folk theory nor the classical theory bears much resemblance to the way in which representations are actually stored and transformed in the human brain. What leads many astray, say Churchland and Sejnowski (1990), is the idea that the structure of an effect directly reflects the structure of its cause (as exemplified by the homuncular theory of embryonic development). Thus, many mistakenly think that the structure of the language through which we express our thoughts is a clear indication of the structure of the thoughts themselves. The Churchlands think that connectionism may afford a glimpse into the future of cognitive neuroscience, a future wherein the classical conception is supplanted by the view that thoughts are just points in hyper-dimensional neural state space and sequences of thoughts are trajectories through this space (see Churchland 1989).

A more moderate position on these issues has been advanced by Daniel Dennett (1991) who largely agrees with the Churchlands in regarding the broadly connectionist character of our actual inner workings. He also maintains, however, that folk psychology is for all practical purposes indispensible. It enables us to adopt a high-level stance towards human behavior wherein we are able to detect patterns that we would miss if we restricted ourselves to a low-level neurological stance. In the same way, he claims, one can gain great predictive leverage over a chess-playing computer by ignoring the low-level details of its inner circuitry and treating it as a thinking opponent. Although an electrical engineer who had perfect information about the device’s low-level inner working could in principle make much more accurate predictions about its behavior, she would get so bogged down in those low-level details as to make her greater predictive leverage useless for any real-time practical purposes. The chess expert wisely forsakes some accuracy in favor of a large increase in efficiency when he treats the machine as a thinking opponent, an intentional agent. Dennett maintains that we do the same when we adopt an intentional stance towards human behavior. Thus, although neuroscience will not discover any of the inner sentences (putatively) posited by folk psychology, a high-level theoretical apparatus that includes them is an indispensable predictive instrument.

On a related note, McCauley (1986) claims that whereas it is relatively common for one high-level  theory to be eliminated in favor of another, it is much harder to find examples where a high-level theory is eliminated in favor of a lower-level theory in the way that the Churchlands envision. However, perhaps neither Dennett nor McCauley are being entirely fair to the Churchlands in this regard. What the Churchlands foretell is the elimination of a high-level folk theory in favor of another high-level theory that emanates out of connectionist and neuroscientific research. Connectionists, we have seen, look for ways of understanding how their models accomplish the tasks set for them by abstracting away from neural particulars. The Churchlands, one might argue, are no exception. Their view that sequences are trajectories through a hyperdimensional landscape abstracts away from most neural specifics, such as action potentials and inhibitory neurotransmitters.

d. Classicists on the Offensive: Fodor and Pylyshyn’s Critique

When connectionism reemerged in the 1980s, it helped to foment resistance to both classicism and folk psychology. In response, stalwart classicists Jerry Fodor and Zenon Pylyshyn (1988) formulated a trenchant critique of connectionism. One imagines that they hoped to do for the new connectionism what Chomsky did for the associationist psychology of the radical behaviorists and what Minsky and Papert did for the old connectionism. They did not accomplish that much, but they did succeed in framing the debate over connectionism for years to come. Though their criticisms of connectionism were wide-ranging, they were largely aimed at showing that connectionism could not account for important characteristics of human thinking, such as its generally truth-preserving character, its productivity, and (most important of all) its systematicity. Of course they had no qualms with the proposal that vaguely connectionist-style processes happen, in the human case, to implement high-level, classical computations.

i. Reason

Unlike Dennett and the Churchlands, Fodor and Pylyshyn (F&P) claim that folk psychology works so well because it is largely correct. On their view, human thinking involves the rule-governed formulation and manipulation of sentences in an inner linguistic code (sometimes called mentalese). [Incidentally, one of the main reasons why classicists maintain that thinking occurs in a special 'thought language' rather than in one’s native natural language is that they want to preserve the notion that people who speak different languages can nevertheless think the same thoughts – for instance, the thought that snow is white.] One bit of evidence that Fodor frequently marshals in support of this proposal is the putative fact that human thinking typically progresses in a largely truth-preserving manner. That is to say, if one’s initial beliefs are true, the subsequent beliefs that one infers from them are also likely to be true. For instance, from the belief that the ATM will not give you any money and the belief that it gave money to the people before and after you in line, you might reasonably form a new belief that there is something wrong with either your card or your account. Says Fodor (1987), if thinking were not typically truth-preserving in this way, there wouldn’t be much point in thinking. Indeed, given a historical context in which philosophers throughout the ages frequently decried the notion that any mechanism could engage in reasoning, it is no small matter that early work in AI yielded the first fully mechanical models and perhaps even artificial implementations of important facets of human reasoning. On the classical conception, this can be done through the purely formal, syntax-sensitive application of rules to sentences insofar as the syntactic properties mirror the semantic ones. Logicians of the late nineteenth and early twentieth century showed how to accomplish just this in the abstract, so all that was left was to figure out (as von Neumann did) how to realize logical principles in artifacts.

F&P (1988) argue that connectionist systems can only ever realize the same degree of truth preserving processing by implementing a classical architecture. This would, on their view, render connectionism a sub-cognitive endeavor. One way connectionists could respond to this challenge would be to create connectionist systems that support truth-preservation without any reliance upon sentential representations or formal inference rules. Bechtel and Abrahamson (2002) explore another option, however, which is to situate important facets of rationality in human interactions with the external symbols of natural and formal languages. Bechtel and Abrahamson argue that “the ability to manipulate external symbols in accordance with the principles of logic need not depend upon a mental mechanism that itself manipulates internal symbols” (1991, 173). This proposal is backed by a pair of connectionist models that learn to detect patterns during the construction of formal deductive proofs and to use this information to decide on the validity of arguments and to accurately fill in missing premises.

ii. Productivity and Systematicity

Much more attention has been pain to other aspects of F&P’s (1988) critique, such as their claim that only a classical architecture can account for the productivity and systematicity of thought. To better understand the nature of their concerns, it might help if we first consider the putative productivity and systematicity of natural languages.

Consider, to start with, the following sentence:

(1)  “The angry jay chased the cat.”

The rules governing English appear to license (1), but not (2), which is made from (modulo capitalization) qualitatively identical parts:

(2)  “Angry the the chased jay cat.”

We who are fluent in some natural language have knowledge of the rules that govern the permissible ways in which the basic components of that language can be arranged – that is, we have mastery of the syntax of the language.

Sentences are, of course, also typically intended to carry or convey some meaning. The meaning of a sentence, say F&P (1988), is determined by the meanings of the individual constituents and by the manner in which they are arranged. Thus (3), which is made from the same constituents as (1), conveys a very different meaning.

(3)  “The angry cat chased the jay.”

Natural language expressions, in other words, have a combinatorial syntax and semantics.

In addition, natural languages appear to be characterized by certain recursive rules which enable the production of an infinite variety of syntactically distinct sentences. For instance, in English one such rule allows any two grammatical statements to be combined with ‘and’. Thus, if (1) and (3) are grammatical, so is this:

(4)  “The angry jay chased the cat and the angry cat chased the jay.”

Sentence (4) too can be combined with another, as in (5) which conjoins (4) and (3):

“The angry jay chased the cat and the angry cat chased the jay, and the angry cat chased the jay.”

Earlier we discussed another recursive principle which allows for center-embedded clauses.

One who has mastered the combinatorial and recursive syntax and semantics of a natural language is, according to classicists like F&P (1988), thereby capable in principle of producing and comprehending an infinite number of grammatically distinct sentences. In other words, their mastery of these linguistic principles gives them a productive linguistic competence. It is also reputed to give them a systematic competence, in that a fluent language user who can produce and understand one sentence can produce and understand systematic variants. A fluent English speaker who can produce and understand (1) will surely be able to produce and understand (3). It is, on the other hand, entirely possible for one who has learned English from a phrase-book (that is, without learning the meanings of the constituents or the combinatorial semantics of the language) to be able to produce and understand (1) but not its systematic variant (3).

Thinking, F&P (1988) claim, is also productive and systematic, which is to say that we are capable of thinking an infinite variety of thoughts and that the ability to think some thoughts is intrinsically connected with the ability to think others. For instance, on this view, anyone who can think the thought expressed by (1) will be able to think the thought expressed by (3). Indeed, claims Fodor (1987), since to understand a sentence is to entertain the thought the sentence expresses, the productivity and systematicity of language imply the productivity and systematicity of thought. F&P (1988) also maintain that just as the productivity and systematicity of language is best explained by its combinatorial and recursive syntax and semantics, so too is the productivity and systematicity of thought. Indeed, they say, this is the only explanation anyone has ever offered.

The systematicity issue has generated a vast debate (see Bechtel & Abrahamson 2002), but one general line of connectionist response has probably garnered the most attention. This approach, which appeals to functional rather than literal compositionality (see van Gelder 1990), is most often associated with Smolensky (1990) and with Pollack (1990), though for simplicity’s sake discussion will be restricted to the latter.

Pollack (1990) uses recurrent connectionist networks to generate compressed, distributed encodings of syntactic strings and subsequently uses those encodings to either recreate the original string or to perform a systematic transformation of it (e.g., from “Mary loved John” to “John loved Mary”). Pollack’s approach was quickly extended by Chalmers (1990), who showed that one could use such compressed distributed representations to perform systematic transformations (namely moving from an active to a passive form) of even sentences with complex embedded clauses. He showed that this could be done for both familiar and novel sentences. What this suggests is that connectionism might offer its own unique, non-classical account of the apparent systematicity of thought processes. However, Fodor and McLaughlin (1990) argue that such demonstrations only show that networks can be forced to exhibit systematic processing, not that they exhibit it naturally in the way that classical systems do. After all, on a classical account, the same rules that license one expression will automatically license its systematic variant. It bears noting, however, that this approach may itself need to impose some ad hoc constraints in order to work. Aizawa (1997) points out, for instance, that many classical systems do not exhibit systematicity. On the flipside, Matthews (1997) notes that systematic variants that are licensed by the rules of syntax need not be thinkable. Waskan (2006) makes a similar point, noting that thinking may be more and less systematic than language and that the actual degree to which thought is systematic may be best accounted for by, theoretically speaking, pushing the structure of the world ‘up’ into the thought medium, rather than pushing the structure of language ‘down’. This might, however, come as cold comfort to connectionists, for it appears to  merely replace one competitor to connectionism with another.

7. Anti-Represenationalism: Dynamical Stystems Theory, A-Life and Embodied Cognition

As alluded to above, whatever F&P may have hoped, connectionism has continued to thrive. Connectionist techniques are now employed in virtually every corner of cognitive science. On the other hand, despite what connectionists may have wished for, these techniques have not come close to fully supplanting classical ones. There is now much more of a peaceful coexistence between the two camps. Indeed, what probably seems far more important to both sides these days is the advent and promulgation of approaches that reject or downplay central assumptions of both classicists and mainstream connectionists, the most important being that human cognition is largely constituted by the creation, manipulation, storage and utilization of representations. Many cognitive researchers who identify themselves with the dynamical systems, artificial life and (albeit to a much lesser extent) embodied cognition endorse the doctrine that one version of the world is enough. Even so, practitioners of the first two approaches have often co-opted connectionist techniques and terminology. In closing, let us briefly consider the rationale behind each of these two approaches and their relation to connectionism.

Briefly, dynamical systems theorists adopt a very high-level perspective on human behavior (inner and/or outer) that treats its state at any given time as a point in high-dimensional space (where the number of dimensions is determined by the number of numerical variables being used to quantify the behavior) and treats its time course as a trajectory through that space (van Gelder & Port 1995). As connectionist research has revealed, there tend to be regularities in the trajectories taken by particular types of system through their state spaces. As paths are plotted, it is often as if the trajectory taken by a system gets attracted to certain regions and repulsed by others, much like a marble rolling across a landscape can get guided by valleys, roll away from peaks, and get trapped in wells (local or global minima). The general goal is to formulate equations like those at work in the physical sciences that will capture such regularities in the continuous time-course of behavior. Connectionist systems have often provided nice case studies in how to characterize a system from the dynamical systems perspective. However, whether working from within this perspective in physics or in cognitive science, researchers find little need to invoke the ontologically strange category of representations in order to understand the time course of a system’s behavior.

Researchers in artificial life primarily focus on creating artificial creatures (virtual or real) that can navigate environments in a fully autonomous manner. The strategy generally favored by artificial life researchers is to start small, with a simple behavior repertoire, to test one’s design in an environment (preferably a real one), to adjust it until success is achieved, and then to gradually add layers of complexity by repeating this process. In one early and influential manifesto of the 'a-life' movement, Rodney Brooks claims, “When intelligence is approached in an incremental manner, with strict reliance on interfacing to the real world through perception and action, reliance on representation disappears” (Brooks 1991). The aims of a-life research are sometimes achieved through the deliberate engineering efforts of modelers, but connectionist learning techniques are also commonly employed, as are simulated evolutionary processes (processes that operate over both the bodies and brains of organisms, for instance).

8. Where Have All the Connectionists Gone?

There perhaps may be fewer today who label themselves “connectionists” than there were during the 1990s. Fodor & Pylyshyn’s (1988) critique may be partly responsible for this shift, though it is probably more because the novelty of the approach has worn off and the initial fervor died down. Also to blame may be the fact that connectionist techniques are now very widely employed throughout cognitive science, often by people who have very little in common ideologically. It is thus increasingly hard to discern among those who utilize connectionist modeling techniques any one clearly demarcated ideology or research program. Even many of those who continue to maintain an at least background commitment to the original ideals of connectionism might nowadays find that there are clearer ways of signaling who they are and what they care about than to call themselves “connectionists.” In any case, whether connectionist techniques are limited in some important respects or not, it is perfectly clear is that connectionist modeling techniques are still powerful and flexible enough as to have been widely embraced by philosophers and cognitive scientists, whether they be mainstream moderates or radical insurgents. It is therefore hard to imagine any technological or theoretical development that would lead to connectionism’s complete abandonment. Thus, despite some early fits and starts, connectionism is now most assuredly here to stay.

9. References and Further Reading

a. References

  • Aizawa, K. (1997). Explaining systematicity, Mind and Language, 12, 115-136.
  • Barsalou, L. (1987). The instability of graded structure: Implications for the nature of concepts. In U. Neisser (Ed.), Concepts and conceptual development: Ecological and intellectual factors in categorization. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 101-140.
  • Bechtel, W. & A. Abrahamsen. (1991). Connectionism and the mind: An introduction to parallel processing in networks. Cambridge, MA: Basil Blackwell.
  • Bechtel, W. & A. Abrahamsen. (2002). Connectionism and the mind: An introduction to parallel processing in networks, 2nd Ed. Cambridge, MA: Basil Blackwell.
    • Highly recommended introduction to connectionism and the philosophy thereof.
  • Boden, M. (2006). Mind as machine: A history of cognitive science. New York: Oxford.
  • Brooks, R. (1991). Intelligence without representation. Artificial Intelligence, 47, 139-159.
  • Chalmers, D. (1990). Syntactic transformations on distributed representations. Connection Science, 2, 53-62.
  • Chomsky, N. (1993). On the nature, use and acquisition of language. In A. Goldman (Ed.), Readings in the Philosophy and Cognitive Science. Cambridge, MA: MIT, 511-534.
  • Churchland, P.M. (1989). A neurocomputational perspective: The nature of mind and the structure of science. Cambridge, MA: MIT.
  • Churchland, P.S. & T. Sejnowski. (1990).  Neural representation and neural computation. Philosophical Perspectives, 4, 343-382.
  • Dennett, D. (1991). Real Patterns. The Journal of Philosophy, 88, 27-51.
  • Elman, J. (1990). Finding Structure in Time. Cognitive Science, 14, 179-211.
  • Fodor, J. (1987). Psychosemantics. Cambridge, MA: MIT.
  • Fodor, J. & B. McLaughlin. (1990). Connectionism and the problem of systematicity: Why Smolensky's solution doesn't work, Cognition, 35, 183-204.
  • Fodor, J. & Z. Pylyshyn. (1988). Connectionism and cognitive architecture: A critical analysis. Cognition, 28, 3-71.
  • Franklin, S. & M. Garzon. (1996). Computation by discrete neural nets. In P. Smolensky, M. Mozer, & D. Rumelhart (Eds.) Mathematical perspectives on neural networks (41-84). Mahwah, NJ: Lawrence Earlbaum.
  • Goodhill, G. (1993). Topography and ocular dominance with positive correlations. Biological Cybernetics, 69, 109-118 .
  • Hebb, D.O. (1949). The Organization of Behavior. New York: Wiley.
  • Horgan, T. & J. Tienson (1991). Overview. In Horgan, T. & J. Tienson (Eds.) Connectionism and the Philosophy of Mind. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Kintsch, W. (1998). Comprehension: A Paradigm for Cognition. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kohonen, T. (1982). Self-organized formation of topologically correct feature maps. Biological Cybernetics, 43, 59-69.
  • Marcus, R. (1995). The acquisition of the English past tense in children and multilayered connectionist networks. Cognition, 56, 271-279.
  • Matthews, R. (1997). Can connectionists explain systematicity? Mind and Language, 12, 154-177.
  • McCauley, R. (1986). Intertheoretic relations and the future of psychology. Philosophy of Science, 53, 179-199.
  • McClelland, J. & D. Rumelhart. (1989). Explorations in parallel distributed processing: A handbook of models, programs, and exercises. Cambridge, MA: MIT.
    • This excellent hands-on introduction to connectionist models of psychological processes has been replaced by: R. O'Reilly & Y. Munakata. (2000). Computational explorations in cognitive neuroscience: Understanding the mind by simulating the brain. Cambridge, MA: MIT. Companion software called Emergent.
  • McCulloch, W. & W. Pitts. (1943). A logical calculus of the ideas immanent in nervous activity Bulletin of Mathematical Biophysics, 5:115-133.
  • Rosenblatt, F. (1958). The perceptron: A probabilistic model for information storage and organization in the brain. Psychological Review, 65, 386-408.
  • Miikkulainen, R. (1993). Subsymbolic Natural Language Processing. Cambridge, MA: MIT.
    • Highly recommended for its introduction to Kohonen nets.
  • Minsky, M. & S. Papert. (1969). Perceptrons: An introduction to computational geometry. Cambridge, MA: MIT.
  • Pinker, S. & A. Prince. (1988). On language and connectionism: Analysis of a parallel distributed processing model of language acquisition. Cognition, 28, 73-193.
  • Pollack, J. (1990). Recursive distributed representations. Artificial Intelligence, 46, 77-105.
  • Plunkett, K. & V. Marchman. (1993). From rote learning to system building: Acquiring verb morphology in children and connectionist nets. Cognition, 48, 21-69.
  • Rey, G. (1983). Concepts and stereotypes. Cognition, 15, 273-262.
  • Rosch, E. & C. Mervis. (1975). Family resemblances: Studies in the internal structure of categories. Cognitive Psychology, 7, 573-605.
  • Rumelhart, D., G. Hinton, & R. Williams. (1986). Learning internal representations by error propagation. In D. Rumelhart & J. McClelland (Eds.), Parallel distributed processing: Explorations in the microstructure of cognition, Vol. 1. Cambridge, MA: MIT, 318-362.
  • Selfridge, O. (1959). Pandemonium: A paradigm for learning. Rpt. in J. Anderson & E. Rosenfeld (1988), Neurocomputing: Foundations of research. Cambridge, MA: MIT, 115-122.
  • Smolensky, P. (1990). Tensor product variable binding and the representation of symbolic structures in connectionist networks. Artificial Intelligence, 46, 159–216.
  • van Gelder, T. (1990). Compositionality: A connectionist variation on a classical theme. Cognitive Science, 14, 355-384.
  • van Gelder, T. & R. Port. (1995). Mind as motion: Explorations in the dynamics of cognition. Cambridge, MA: MIT.
  • Waskan, J. (2006). Models and Cognition: Prediction and explanation in everyday life and in science. Cambridge, MA: MIT.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (1953). Philosophical Investigations. New York: Macmillan.

b. Connectionism Freeware

  • BugBrain provides an excellent, accessible, and highly entertaining game-based hands-on tutorial on the basics of neural networks and gives one a good idea of what a-life is all about as well. BugBrain comes with some learning components, but they are not recommended.
  • Emergent is research-grade software that accompanies O'Reilly and Munakata’s Computational explorations in cognitive neuroscience (referenced above).
  • Simbrain is a fairly accessible, but somewhat weak, tool for implementing a variety of common neural network architectures.
  • Framsticks is a wonderful program that enables anyone with the time and patience to evolve virtual stick creatures and their neural network controllers.

Author Information

Jonathan Waskan
University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign
U. S. A.

Divine Immutability

Divine immutability, the claim that God is immutable, is a central part of traditional Christianity, though it has come under sustained attack in the last two hundred years.  This article first catalogues the historical precedent for and against this claim, then discusses different answers to the question, “What is it to be immutable?”   Two definitions of divine immutability receive careful attention.  The first is that for God to be immutable is for God to have a constant character and to be faithful in divine promises; this is a definition of “weak immutability.”  The second, “strong immutability,” is that for God to be immutable is for God to be wholly unchanging. After showing some implications of the definitions, the article focuses on strong immutability and provides some common arguments against the claim that God is immutable, understood in that way.  While most of the historical evidence discussed in this article is from Christian sources, the core discussion of what it is to be strongly immutable, and the arguments against it, are not particular to Christianity.

Table of Contents

  1. Some Historical Evidence for Divine Immutability
    1. Biblical Evidence for and against Divine Immutability
    2. Conciliar Evidence for Divine Immutability
    3. The Protestant Reformers and Divine Immutability
    4. Divine Immutability and Traditional Christianity
  2. What It Is To Be Immutable
    1. Immutability as Constancy of Character
    2. Strong Immutability—God Does Not Change in Any Way
  3. Objections to Strong Immutability
    1. God’s Knowledge of Temporally Indexed Truths, Omniscience and Immutability
    2. Immutability and Modal Collapse
    3. Responsiveness and an Immutable God
    4. Personhood and Immutability
    5. Immutability, Time, and Freedom
  4. Related Issues
    1. Divine Timelessness or Eternality
    2. Divine Impassibility
    3. The Incarnation
    4. Intrinsic/Extrinsic Properties
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Some Historical Evidence for Divine Immutability

Divine immutability is a central aspect of the traditional Christian doctrine of God, as this section will argue. For more detail on this point, see Dorner (1994) chapter 2 and Weinandy (1985).

a. Biblical Evidence for and against Divine Immutability

There are many biblical passages commonly cited as evidence either for or against the doctrine of divine immutability. This short section discusses just a few, with the aim of showing that the Bible is not explicitly clear one way or the other on the question of whether God is immutable. (See Gavrilyuk (2004), p 37-46, for a discussion of these passages and others.) Whichever view one takes on immutability, there are difficult passages for which one has to account.

In some places the Bible appears to speak in favor of divine mutability. For instance, consider these two passages:

Did Hezekiah king of Judah or anyone else in Judah put [Micah] to death? Did not Hezekiah fear the LORD and seek his favor? And did not the LORD relent, so that he did not bring the disaster he pronounced against them? (Jeremiah 26:1. This and all subsequent quotations from the Bible are taken from the New International Version).

In this first example we see the Lord relenting, not doing what he had said he would do.  That appears to be a case of changing from one course or plan of action to another.  Such change seems even clearer in the following case, where God, in response to a sin of David, both sends an angel to destroy Jerusalem, then, grieving the destruction, calls off the angel.

And God sent an angel to destroy Jerusalem. But as the angel was doing so, the LORD saw it and was grieved because of the calamity and said to the angel who was destroying the people, "Enough! Withdraw your hand" (1 Chronicles 21:15).

In this example, God puts a particular plan of action into effect, then, it appears, grieves his decision and reverses it.  God does it as a result of the calamity the angel was causing when destroying the people. God responds to his creation here, and relents.  Both of these texts, and others like them, seem to indicate that God changes, at least in changing his mind and commands. Other relevant biblical passages include, but are not limited to, Exodus 32:14 and Amos 7:1-3.

If all the evidence from the Bible were against immutability, one might think that the case against divine immutability, at least for the Christian and the Jew, would be closed.  However, the Bible also seems to teach that God does not change his mind.  For instance:

God is not a man, that he should lie, nor a son of man, that he should change his mind. Does he speak and then not act? Does he promise and not fulfill? (Numbers 23:19).

He who is the Glory of Israel does not lie or change his mind; for he is not a man, that he should change his mind (1 Samuel 15:29).

These two passages claim that God doesn’t change his mind and so are in tension with the previous two texts.  Beyond these two passages that claim that God does not change his mind, there are also passages where God is said not to change, for instance:

I the LORD do not change. So you, O descendants of Jacob, are not destroyed (Malachi 3:6).

Every good and perfect gift is from above, coming down from the Father of the heavenly lights, who does not change like shifting shadows (James 1:17).

Theologians and philosophers who wish to provide scriptural evidence for divine immutability have commonly cited these passages.

So the Biblical texts are either unclear as to whether God changes or not, or they are inconsistent.  If one wishes to maintain the consistency of scripture on the doctrine of God, one either needs to read the passages where God appears to change in light of the passages where it claims he does not, or vice versa.  But either way the Biblical evidence seems too weak to prove either divine immutability or its contrary.

b. Conciliar Evidence for Divine Immutability

While the biblical evidence seems to underdetermine whether divine immutability is true, the conciliar evidence favors the doctrine of divine immutability. While the later councils explicitly include immutability in their discussions of God’s nature, the earlier councils only discussed divine immutability in relation to the incarnation, the Christian teaching that the Second Person of the Trinity, the Son of God, became man.  This is because the incarnation seemed to require a change of some sort in God.  These early councils employed divine immutability to argue that there was no change in the Godhead when the Son became incarnate.

For instance, consider the conclusion to the creed of the first general council, Nicaea, in 325 (note that this is the end of the original creed, and not the more familiar Nicene-Constantinopolitan creed commonly employed in liturgies today):

And those who say “there once was when he was not”, and “before he was begotten he was not”, and that he came to be from things that were not, or from another hypostasis or substance, affirming that the Son of God is subject to change or alteration—these the catholic and apostolic church anathematizes (Tanner, 1990, p 5, emphasis  mine).

Here the council anathematizes those who claim that the Son of God is subject to change or alteration.  Some, particularly the Arians, were teaching that the Son was a creature and not the Creator.  This anathema is an attempt to rule out such a position by ruling out change in the Son, which only makes sense if God is changeless.  For, how would anathematizing the view that the Son changes rule out the Son’s being a creature unless being changing is incompatible with being God?  One should note, though, that even though the Arians taught that the Son was mutable, they didn’t deny the immutability of the Father, and in fact were attempting to safeguard the immutability of God in their teaching that the Son was a creature (see Gavrilyuk (2004) p 105-7, Weinandy (1985) p 5-20 for more on this).

Also, see the third letter of Cyril to Nestorius from the council of Ephesus, 431, which says, when speaking of Christ:

We do not say that his flesh was turned into the nature of the godhead or that the unspeakable Word of God was changed into the nature of the flesh. For he (the Word) is unalterable and absolutely unchangeable and remains always the same as the scriptures say (Tanner, 1990, p 51, the emphasis is mine.)

Here the council claims that the Word of God, the Second Person of the Trinity, is unalterable and absolutely unchangeable.  Notice, too, that the claim is made to defend against the unorthodox view that the twin natures of Christ mixed in the incarnation.  So whatever immutability comes to, it must come to something that rules out the admixture of natures.

Thirdly, see the Letter of Cyril to John of Antioch about Peace, again from the council of Ephesus:

...God the Word, who came down from above and from heaven, "emptied himself, taking the form of a slave", and was called son of man, though all the while he remained what he was, that is God (for he is unchangeable and immutable by nature)… (Tanner,1990, p 72, the emphasis is mine).

Here the council claims that God is unchangeable and immutable by nature.  Whereas the first two passages cited attribute immutability to the Son, this passage attributes it more generally to God.  But even still, it would be an odd Trinitarian theology that claimed the Son to be immutable but the other Persons to be mutable. Also of note is the letter of Pope Leo to Flavian, bishop of Constantinople, about Eutyches, read at the council of Chalcedon where Pope Leo writes of “the unalterable God, whose will is indistinguishable from his goodness” (Tanner, 1990, p 79).

The closer to the present one comes in western conciliar documents, the more explicitly and repeatedly one finds affirmation of divine immutability. For instance, see the fourth council of Constantinople (869-870), the eighth ecumenical council, by western reckoning, where the Fathers claim in their creedal statement:

We confess, indeed, God to be one…ever existing without beginning, and eternal, ever the same and like to himself, and suffering no change or alteration… (Tanner, 1990, p 161).

Notice that here the object said to be without change or alteration is explicitly God.  The first two conciliar statements cited claim that the Son is immutable, and the third quotation appears to claim that God, and not just the Son, is immutable, but here the object is clearly God.  Also, the creed from the Fourth Lateran council, which met in 1215, begins, “We firmly believe and simply confess that there is only one true God, eternal and immeasurable, almighty, unchangeable, incomprehensible and ineffable…” (Tanner, 1990, p 230); the council of Basel-Ferrara-Florence-Rome, which met from 1431-1445, “deliver[ing]…the following true and necessary doctrine...firmly professes and preaches one true God, almighty, immutable and eternal…” (Tanner, 1990, p 570); the First Vatican council, which met from 1869-1870, “believes and acknowledges that there is one true and living God…he is one, singular, completely simple and unchangeable spiritual substance…” (Tanner, 1990, p 805)  Such texts show that the early church councils of undivided Christendom, as well as the later western councils of the Catholic Church, clearly teach that God is immutable.

c. The Protestant Reformers and Divine Immutability

It isn’t just early Christianity in general and Catholicism in particular that dogmatically affirms divine immutability.  One can find divine immutability in the confessions and canons of traditional Protestantism.  For instance, see the confession of faith from the French (or Gallican) Confession of 1559:

We believe and confess that there is but one God, who is one sole and simple essence, spiritual, eternal, invisible, immutable, infinite, incomprehensible, ineffable, omnipotent; who is all-wise all-good, all-just, and all-merciful (Schaff, 1877, p 359-360).

Also, see the Belgic Confession of 1561, Article 1:

We all believe with the heart, and confess with the mouth, that there is one only simple and spiritual Being, which we call God; and that he is eternal, incomprehensible invisible, immutable, infinite, almighty, perfectly wise, just, good, and the overflowing fountain of all good. (Schaff, 1877, p 383-384)

For a confessional Lutheran affirmation of divine immutability, see, for instance, "The Strong Declaration of The Formula of Concord," XI.75, found in The Book of Concord:

And since our election to eternal life is founded not upon our godliness or virtue, but alone upon the merit of Christ and the gracious will of His Father, who cannot deny Himself, because He is unchangeable in will and essence…

In addition, see the first head, eleventh article of the canons of Dordt, from 1618-1619:

And as God himself is most wise, unchangeable, omniscient, and omnipotent, so the election made by him can neither be interrupted nor changed, recalled nor annulled; neither can the elect be cast away, nor their number diminished (Schaff, 1877, p 583).

And, finally, see the Westminster Confession of Faith from 1647:

There is but one only living and true God, who is infinite in being and perfection, 'a most pure spirit, invisible, without body, parts, or passions, immutable, immense, eternal, incomprehensible, almighty, most wise, most holy... (Schaff, 1877, p 606).

These texts show that the dogmatic and confessional affirmations of divine immutability carry on into Protestantism.

d. Divine Immutability and Traditional Christianity

If one understands traditional Christianity either as the faith of the early, undivided Church or as the intersection of the great, historical confessional statements of Christendom, then one has strong reason to believe that traditional Christianity includes the claim that God is immutable.  Just because one has reason to affirm that God is immutable, however, does not give one reason to favor a particular definition of immutability.  The following section discusses the two leading rival theories of what it is for God to be immutable.

2. What It Is To Be Immutable

Even if it is clear that traditional Christianity includes the doctrine of divine immutability, what, precisely, that doctrine amounts to is not perspicuous.  There are many subtle and nuanced views of immutability—far too many to receive individual attention in this article.  This article focuses on the two most commonly discussed views of immutability.  One is that divine immutability merely guarantees that God’s character is unchanging, and that God will remain faithful to his promises and covenants.  This first view does not preclude other sorts of change in God.  Another, stronger, view of immutability is that the doctrine of divine immutability rules out all intrinsic change in God.  This latter understanding of immutability is the historically common view.

a. Immutability as Constancy of Character

Some thinkers see immutability as the claim that God’s character is constant.  For instance, see Richard Swinburne’s The Coherence of Theism, where he discusses both types of immutability under consideration in this section. Here he sides with the constancy of character view, which he describes as "[i]n the weaker way to say of a person that he is immutable is simply to say that he cannot change in character." (Swinburne, 1993, p 219)  Isaak Dorner’s view is that God is ethically immutable but that divine vitality requires divine change. See Dorner (1994), especially the helpful introduction by Williams, p 19-23, and Dorner’s third essay, “The Reconstruction of the Immutability Doctrine.”  For discussions of Dorner, see Richards (2003) p 198-199 and Williams (1986). This view of immutability understands divine immutability to be the claim that God is constant in his character and virtue; that God is not fickle; and that God will remain true to his promises.

Notice that if immutability is understood in this sense, the Bible passages cited in section 1 may be easier to reconcile than on strong immutability.  The passages where God relents aren’t passages that prove that God is not constant in character.  It may well be God’s good character that causes him to relent.  Given the previous circumstances, God formed one set of intentions due to his constantly good character.  When the circumstances changed, God formed a different set of intentions, again due to his constantly good character.  What changes in these passages is not God’s good character. It is the circumstances God is in when he forms his intentions. Where the Bible teaches that God is unchanging, it means, in this understanding of immutability, that God’s character will not change.  It does not mean the stronger claim that God will not change at all.

One more point in favor of this understanding of immutability is that if it were true, other problems with divine immutability, problems discussed below in section 3, would no longer be problems.  For instance, there would be no problem of explaining how an unchanging God has knowledge of changing truths (e.g., like what time it is).  God’s knowledge could change, on this understanding of immutability, provided that such change in knowledge does not rule out constancy of character.

Another problem discussed in section 3 is that of the responsiveness of an immutable God.  Given weak immutability, divine immutability doesn’t necessitate divine unresponsiveness.  This is because God’s responding to prayers doesn’t require that his character change.  In fact, it could be exactly because his character does not change that he responds to prayers.  So responsiveness is not incompatible with this notion of immutability.  On the constancy of character understanding of immutability, not all change, and in particular, not change as a result of responding to prayer, is inconsistent with immutability.

Nevertheless, if this is the burden of divine immutability—that God’s character is constant—who would deny it (that is, what theist would deny it)?  Divine immutability is a modest thesis when understood as constancy of character.  But even if it is innocuous, and even if it has the above-mentioned positive features, it still has difficulties.  It still leaves a problem for biblical exegesis.  That’s because the first two passages discussed above in section 1 seem to show God changing his mind, whereas the second two seem to teach that God does not change his mind.  So while the fact that it provides some way to reconcile some of the biblical evidence is a point in favor of the constancy of character view, it still faces a difficulty in understanding the scriptures that seem to claim that God does not change his mind.

Moreover, divine immutability understood as only involving the constancy of character seems in tension with the use that the early teachings of the church at the first ecumenical councils made of the concept.  For instance, both quotations from the council of Ephesus claim that the Second Person of the Trinity did not change when assuming the human nature, and both point, as evidence, to the fact that he is unchangeable and immutable.  In fact, the second quotation from Ephesus has it that God is unchangeable and immutable by God’s very nature.  Immutability, however, would be no evidence for the claim that the Second Person of the Trinity didn’t change when assuming the human nature if all immutability amounts to is constancy of character.  How could the constancy of the Second Person’s character entail that he would not change when assuming the human nature?   What does that have to do with whether Christ’s “flesh was turned into the nature of the godhead or that the unspeakable Word of God was changed into the nature of the flesh”?  The change being ruled out at Ephesus is not moral change or change of character, but change of properties and change of nature.  So the early church councils don’t have the constancy of character view in mind when they claim that God is immutable.  If they had such a view in mind, they wouldn’t have thought to point to divine immutability in support of the claim that Christ didn’t change in becoming incarnate.

In regard to the later church councils and confessional statements, they don’t define the meaning of “immutability” when they assert it in the list of divine attributes.  Again, however, one notices that they do not put the affirmation of divine immutability in discussion of God’s character but in discussion of God’s existence.  One finds immutability in a list of other nonmoral attributes, and not subjugated to the affirmation that God is wholly good or holy.

For instance, the Fourth council of Constantinople teaches that God is immutable and unchangeable, and this not in relation to God’s character but in discussion of God’s very existence (“ever existing without beginning, and eternal, ever the same and like to himself, and suffering no change or alteration….”).  The claim of immutability isn’t made in relation to God’s moral character but in a list of affirmations concerning God’s mode of existence.

So, for the reasons given in the preceding paragraphs, divine immutability, taken in its traditional sense, should not be understood to mean merely constancy of character.  Surely constancy of character is a part of the concept.  But divine immutability must be more robust than that to do the work it has been tapped to do in traditional Christianity.

b. Strong Immutability—God Does Not Change in Any Way

A stronger understanding of divine immutability is that God is literally unable to change.  As Thomas Aquinas, a commonly cited proponent of this view, says: God is “altogether immutable…it is impossible for God to be in any way changeable” (Summa Theologiae, the First Part, Question nine, Article one, the response; the quotation is from the translation at God doesn’t change by coming to be or ceasing to be; by gaining or losing qualities; by any quantitative growth or diminishment; by learning or forgetting anything; by starting or stopping willing what he wills; or in any other way that requires going from being one way to being another.

Whenever a proposition about God changes truth-value, the reason for the change in truth-value of the proposition is not, on this view of immutability, because of a change in God, but because of some other change in something else. (I speak here of a proposition changing its truth-value, though it is not essential for divine immutability that propositions can change truth-values.  If the reader holds a view where propositions have their truth-values eternally, the reader may substitute in his or her preferred paraphrase for apparent change in the truth-value of propositions.)  Father Jones is praising God, and so the proposition that God is being praised by Father Jones is true.  Later that same proposition is no longer true, but not because of any change in God.  It is no longer true because Father Jones stopped praising God, and not because God is in any way different than he was.  Likewise in other situations: God doesn’t go from being one way to being another; rather, something else changes and on account of that a proposition about God changes its truth-value.

One may wonder about the viability of this account when it deals with events that clearly seem to involve God doing something.  For instance, God talked to Abraham at a certain time in history.  Consider the proposition: God is talking to Abraham.  That was true at one point (Hagar might have whispered it to Ishmael after the youth asked what his father was doing).  At other times, God is not talking to Abraham.  But isn’t the change here a change in what God is doing?  Doesn’t God go from talking to not talking to Abraham?  And if so, how does that fit with the claim made in the previous paragraph, that changes in propositions about God are due to changes in things besides God?

The defender of strong immutability will draw a distinction here between the actions of God and their effects.  God, on this view, is unchangingly performing his divine action or actions, but the effects come and go.  Compare: In one swift action I throw a barrel full of messages in bottles overboard in the middle of the Atlantic.  This action of mine has multiple effects: it causes waves and ripples as the bottles hit the water.  Later, it causes other effects as people read the messages I’ve sent.  I convey some information to those whom the bottles reach, but the action I performed to do so has long since ceased.  Depending on one’s view of divine simplicity and divine eternity, some aspects of this analogy will have to be changed.  But the point remains: one action can have multiple effects at multiple times.  God immutably acts to talk with Abraham, and either does so atemporally or, if God is inside of time, has always and will always so act.  The changing of the truth-value of the proposition that God is talking to Abraham is not due to God changing, on this theory, but due to the effects of God’s action coming and going.

Strong immutability has a few things going for it.  First, it is congruent with the final four passages of Scripture cited in section 1.  If God is strongly immutable, he cannot change his mind, and he also cannot change.  So these last four passages pose no problem on this understanding of immutability.

Also, this stronger notion of immutability does the work needed for the early councils, which point to immutability to show that the Second Person of the Trinity does not change when assuming the human nature.  The conciliar reference to divine immutability is understandable if immutability is understood as strong immutability, whereas it is not understandable if it is understood in the weaker constancy of character sense.

Finally, this strong understanding of divine immutability is very common in church history. Just like the constancy of character model of divine immutability, however, this understanding is not without its own problems.  First it has to provide a way of understanding the first two scripture citations, as well as the many others where God appears to change. Furthermore, it has other difficulties, which are consider in the following section.

3. Objections to Strong Immutability

There are many objections to the strong view of divine immutability, some of which were discussed in the previous section, including changes which appear to be changes in God, but which, on this view, are parsed as changes in other things, such as the effects of the unchanging divine action.  This section discusses some other objections to strong immutability.

a. God’s Knowledge of Temporally Indexed Truths, Omniscience and Immutability

Here is a truth that I know:  that it is now 2:23pm.  That is something I couldn’t know a minute ago, and it is something that I won’t know in a minute.  At that time, I’ll know a different truth: that it is now 2:24pm.  Either God knows such temporally indexed truths—truths that include reference to particular times at which they are true—or not.  If God does not know such truths, then he is not omniscient, since there is something to be known—something a lowly creature like me does, in fact, know—of which God is ignorant.  Since very few theists, especially of a traditional stripe, are willing to give up divine omniscience, very few will be willing to claim that God is ignorant of temporally changing truths like truths about what time it is.

If God is omniscient, then God knows such temporally changing truths.  If God does know such temporally changing truths, then God changes, since God goes from knowing that it is now 2:23pm to knowing that it is now 2:24pm.  And worse, God changes with much more frequency, since there are more fine-grained truths to know about time than which minute it is (for instance, what second it is, what millisecond it is, etc.)  If God knows such truths at some times but not at others, God changes.  And if God changes, divine immutability is false.  So if God is omniscient, he is not immutable.  Therefore, God is either not immutable or not omniscient.  And since both views are explicitly held by traditional Christianity (and other monotheisms) there is a problem here for the traditional proponent of divine immutability.  This argument was put forward forcefully by Norman Kretzmann in his article Omniscience and Immutability (1966).

There are a few common responses to this argument.  First, one can claim that in order to be omniscient, God needn’t know indexed truths as indexed truths.  Second, one might claim that knowledge is not an intrinsic state or property, and that God’s immutability extends only to God’s intrinsic properties.  Third, one might argue that God does not know in the same way that we know, and this problem arises only if God knows things by being acquainted with particular propositions, as we know things.  Fourth, one might respond by assuming God is atemporally eternal and distinguishing the present-tensed terms in the premises between the eternal and temporal present.

Consider the first response.  God needn’t know that now it is 2:23pm.  Rather he knows the same fact under a non-temporally-indexed description.  For instance, God knows that the expression of this proposition, that it is now 2:23pm, is simultaneous with a state that, by convention, we call 2:23pm.  Such knowledge of simultaneity doesn’t require a temporal indexing, and so doesn’t require change across time.  One may wonder here, though, whether indexicals can be eliminated from all indexed propositions without any change in the meaning of the propositions. (For more on whether knowledge of indexical propositions can be reduced to knowledge of nonindexed propositions, see John Perry (1979).)

The second response is put forward by Brian Leftow.  Leftow understands divine immutability as the doctrine that God undergoes no change of intrinsic properties.  Intrinsic properties are properties that involve only the bearer of that property, or, put another way, properties that a thing would have even if it were the only thing in existence, or, put another way, properties a thing would have that don’t require other things to have particular properties (Leftow, 2004). My shape is a property intrinsic to me, as is my being rational.  If you could quarantine me from the influence of everything else, I’d still have my bodily shape and my rationality.  My distance from the Eiffel Tower or height relative to my little cousin, however, are extrinsic properties, since they require the existence of certain things and their having particular properties.  By changing something else and leaving me the same—let my cousin grow for a few more years—you can change my extrinsic properties.  But not so with my intrinsic properties. (This is a rough understanding of intrinsic properties, since if you quarantined me off from the influence of everything I wouldn’t have air to breathe, wouldn’t be under the influence of gravity, light, or anything else.  What it is to be intrinsic is notoriously difficult to define.  For more on intrinsic properties, see David Denby (2006).)

Is God’s knowledge intrinsic or extrinsic to God?  On this definition of intrinsic, God’s knowledge of creatures is extrinsic.  For instance, God’s being such that he knows that it is now 2:24pm entails that something else (for instance, the universe, or the present) has a property (for instance, to give some examples from Leftow (2008), being a certain age, or being a certain temporal distance from the first instant). Likewise for God’s knowledge of other changing facts; since God’s knowing that a is F, where a is not God, entails something about another being having a property—namely, it entails that a is F—such properties of God are extrinsic.  Hence God’s going from knowing that a is F to knowing that a is not F does not require an intrinsic change, and thus is not contrary to divine immutability.

This response faces a difficulty because even if God’s knowledge of other things is extrinsic, since it entails properties in things other than God, belief is not extrinsic.  My knowledge of who is in the adjoining office changes when people come and go, since knowledge entails truth, and the truth of who is there changes.  But my belief of who is there, having no necessary relation to truth, can remain constant even across change in truth-values.  This shows that even if knowledge is intrinsic, since it fluctuates with truth, belief is not extrinsic, since beliefs can be as they are whether or not the world is as they present it.

So even if God’s knowledge of creatures is extrinsic, God’s beliefs concerning creatures are intrinsic, since they don’t require anything of creatures.  This suggests that the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction will not save strong immutability from an argument from changing truths based on beliefs rather than knowledge.  In response to an argument run from beliefs rather than knowledge, one might point out that God believes all and only what is true.  Thus God's beliefs about creatures, and not merely his knowledge about them, will be extrinsic. This is because God believes something if and only if he knows it, and he knows it if and only if it is true: God's belief that a is F entails, and is entailed by, that a is F.

A second difficulty with Leftow’s response is that knowing and believing seem to be quintessential intrinsic properties, which might lead one to reject this understanding of intrinsic properties.  A third problem is that this view, far from keeping God unchanging, instead has some of his properties changing every instant, since he extrinsically changes with every passing instant.  If change of a property entails change full stop, and it seems to, then God is continually changing on this view.  A fourth and final problem is that this answer is inconsistent with another traditional attribute of God—atemporality.  An atemporal God cannot change at all, since change requires time.  So even if this response can answer the other problems, the proponent of divine eternality, and this includes Leftow, will not be able to embrace this response.

Tom Sullivan champions the third response. He argues that the problem arises due to a misunderstanding of how God knows.  We know by being properly related to certain thoughts or propositions.  So when the time changes, the proposition or thought we need to be related to in order to know the truth changes.  But if God does not know by being related to propositions, but in some other sui generis way that doesn’t require change in relation to propositions, then the problem may be defused (Sullivan, 1991).

This is a negative response, since it only says we don’t know as God knows, and doesn’t spell out the mode of knowing that God has.  And this counts against the response, since it doesn’t give us a way of understanding how God knows.  By being undeveloped, it is hard to analyze its merits.  Nevertheless, if it is true that God knows in a way unique to him, then that way may help solve the problem.

A final response is due to Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann. Their response assumes divine eternity, which implies, in part, that God is atemporal.  They argue that the claim that God knows what time it is now is ambiguous between four readings, depending on whether the “knows” is understood as an eternally present or temporally present verb, and depending on whether the now refers to the temporal now or the atemporal now.  Thus, God knows (eternally or temporally) what time it is now (that is, in the temporal present or the eternal present).  Nothing can know what time it is in the eternal present, since in the eternal present there is no time.  So we must understand the sense of ‘now’ to be ranging over the temporal present and not the eternal present.  God, since eternal, cannot know at the present time, but must know eternally.  So the only viable reading of the four possible readings is God knows eternally what is happening in the temporal present.  Consider the following inference introduced earlier: “If God does know such temporally changing truths, then God changes, since God goes from knowing that it is now 2:23pm to knowing that it is now 2:24pm.”  This inference, Stump and Kretzmann claim, does not hold when it is disambiguated as they disambiguate it.  For God eternally knows that at different times different truths are true, for instance, that it is now (at the temporal present) a certain time, but he knows these truths in one unchanging, atemporal action.  God’s eternal knowledge not only doesn’t allow for change; it positively rules change out, since change is inconsistent with eternity.  God eternally knows what is happening now, and at every other time, but in so knowing doesn’t go from being one way to being another.  Rather God simultaneously knows (on the assumption of divine eternity) in one act of knowing all temporally indexed truths (Stump and Kretzmann, 1981, p 455-458).

This response requires the assumption of divine eternity, which may be a cost for some defenders of divine immutability.  Also, it requires an understanding of simultaneity that can allow for God to be simultaneous with all times, but not entail that all times be simultaneous. Stump and Kretzmann offer such an account of simultaneity. (For more on this topic, see Leftow (1991) chapters 14 and 15.)

b. Immutability and Modal Collapse

One might worry that strong immutability leads to a modal collapse—that whatever is actually the case is necessary and whatever is not the case is impossible.  For, one might think, if it is impossible that God change, then no matter what happens, God will be the same.  So, no matter what happens, God will talk to Abraham at a certain time.  God can’t change to do anything else.  And if God can’t change to do anything else, then it seems like he’s stuck doing what he does, knowing what he knows, desiring what he desires, and so on, come what may.  And if that’s true, it is a small step to saying nothing could be different than it is, since if God hadn’t talked to Abraham at a certain time, God would be different.  And if God were different, he would be mutable.

The key to responding to this objection is to draw a distinction between being different in different circumstances and changing.  Divine immutability rules out that God go from being one way to being another way.  But it does not rule out God knowing, desiring, or acting differently than he does.  It is possible that God not create anything.  If God hadn’t created anything, he wouldn’t talk to Abraham at a certain time (since no Abraham would exist).  But such a scenario doesn’t require that God change, since it doesn’t require that there be a time when God is one way, and a later time when he is different.  Rather, it just requires the counterfactual difference that if God had not created, he would not talk to Abraham.  Such a truth is neutral to whether or not God changes.  In short, difference across possible worlds does not entail difference across times.  Since all that strong immutability rules out is difference across times, divine immutability is not inconsistent with counterfactual difference, and hence does not entail a modal collapse.  Things could have been otherwise than they are, and, had they been different, God would immutably know things other than he does, all without change (to see more on this, see Stump (2003) p 109-115.) In the words of one Catholic dogmatist:

Because of His unchangeableness God cannot revoke what he has once freely decreed,—such decisions, for instance, as to create a visible world, to redeem the human race, to permit Christ to die on the cross, etc.—though it is possible, of course, that some other Economy different from the present might be governed by entirely different divine decrees (Pohle, 1946, p 283).

One might still have worries about modal collapse here, especially if one affirms the doctrine of divine simplicity along with strong immutability, as most proponents of strong immutability do.

As I’ve argued, strong immutability rules out differences across times, but not across possible situations or worlds (or Economies, as Pohle has it).  The doctrine of divine simplicity—the thesis that in God there is no composition whatsoever, that God is uniquely metaphysically simple—seems to rule out difference across possible worlds. For what is there in God to be different if God is wholly simple?  So it seems that these two doctrines together rule out God’s being different at all, either across time or across worlds, and so, together, they seem to entail a modal collapse.

The first thing to note here is that, even if it is true that the doctrines of divine simplicity and strong immutability together entail a modal collapse—and there is good reason to be suspicious of this claim—the doctrine of divine simplicity is doing all the work in entailing the modal collapse.  This is because it, and it alone, seems to entail that God is the same in all possible worlds—strong immutability is silent on this point.  The second thing to note here is that the doctrine of divine simplicity can be understood in many different ways, some of which do not require simplicity to entail modal collapse.  Enumerating and defending these ways, however, is beyond the scope of this entry. (For two such understandings of divine simplicity, see Stump (2003), p 109-115, and Brower (2008)).

c. Responsiveness and an Immutable God

Adherents to the three great monotheisms, as well as other theists, traditionally believe that God answers prayers.  Answering prayers requires a response to the actions of another (in particular, a response to a petition).  Here is an argument that begins with responsiveness and concludes to a mutable God.  God is responsive to prayers.  Anything that is responsive, in responding, undergoes change.  Thus if God responds to prayers, then God undergoes change.  If God undergoes change, then God is not immutable.  Therefore, if God responds to prayers, then God is not immutable.

One response to this argument is to define immutability in the weaker sense of constancy of character (the discussion here follows Eleonore Stump’s treatment of divine responsiveness in her book Aquinas (Stump, 2003, p 115-118).  See also Stump and Kretzmann, “Eternity,” especially pages 450-451).  Immutability, so defined, does not rule out responsiveness to prayers.  In fact, it might be God’s character that accounts for divine responsiveness.  The defender of the strong immutability, however, will have to make a different reply.  Since she will affirm that God responds to prayers, she will reject the claim that responsiveness requires change.  One way to support such a rejection is to provide an analysis of responsiveness that doesn’t require change across time.  Here are two such analyses:

J is responsive to T’s request to x if and only if J does x because T requested it.

J is responsive to T’s request to x if and only if J does x, and J might not have done x if T didn’t request it.

If either of these two closely related views is correct, then responsiveness doesn’t require temporal priority or change.  Notice that nothing in these two understandings of responsiveness requires change in the part of a responder.  In many cases where someone changes in responding it is, in part, due to her gaining new knowledge or having to prepare to respond.  But suppose that there was no point in her existence where she didn’t know that to which she responds or isn’t prepared to respond.  It might be hard to imagine what that would be like for a human, since we humans were once ignorant, powerless babes.  But suppose a person were omniscient and omnipotent for all of his existence.  God, since omniscient, knows of all petitions, and, since omnipotent, needn’t ever prepare to answer a petition.  So God doesn’t fall under the conditions that humans fall under which require change on their parts to respond.  God can be immutably responding to the petitions of his followers.  That is, God can act in certain ways because his followers ask him to, and he might not have acted that way had they not asked.  But he doesn’t need to change in order to do so.

What responsiveness does require is counterfactual difference.  That is, had the circumstances been different than they are, then God might have done differently.  And that’s true.  Had Monica not asked for Augustine’s conversion, and God saved Augustine, at least in part, because Monica asked him to, God might not have converted Augustine.  All this leads to an important point: responsiveness is a modal, not temporal, concept.  That is, responsiveness has to do with difference across possible situations and not change across times. To respond is to do something because of something else.  Since we’ve seen in the previous objection that divine immutability does not rule out counterfactual difference, responsiveness is not ruled out by immutability.  While in very many cases it seems that responsiveness will require change, it does not require change in situations where the responder need not gain knowledge and need not prepare to respond.

d. Personhood and Immutability

Some thinkers have claimed that there is an inconsistency in something’s being both a person and unchanging.  One reason for thinking that personhood and immutability are inconsistent is that being a person requires being able to respond, and responsiveness is not possible for something immutable.  That objection was already discussed in the proceeding section.  But there are other reasons for thinking that personhood and immutability are inconsistent.

Richard Swinburne claims that personhood and immutability are inconsistent because immutability is inconsistent with responsiveness, as the previous objection had it, and additionally because immutability is inconsistent with freedom.  God is free, and, according to Swinburne:

[A]n agent is perfectly free at a certain time if his action results from his own choice at that time and if his choice is not itself brought about by anything else.  Yet a person immutable in the strong sense would be unable to perform any action at a certain time other than what he had previously intended to do.  His course of action being fixed by his past choices, he would not be perfectly free (Swinburne, 1993, p 222).

A strongly immutable God cannot be free, and God is perfectly free, so God is not strongly immutable.

One response to this problem is to invoke divine timelessness.  If God is outside of time, this passage, which is about things that are “free at a certain time” does not apply to God. Furthermore, if we were to drop the “at a certain time” from the text, the proponent of divine timelessness would still have a response to this argument.  Given that God is atemporal, it isn’t true of God that he “previously intended to do” anything.  There are no previous or later intentions for an atemporal being—they are all at once.  Likewise, he would have no “past choices” to fix his actions.  So this argument is not applicable to an atemporal, immutable person.

Even for a temporally located immutable person, there are still responses to this argument.  The perfectly free, temporally located, immutable person needn’t have his actions brought about by anything else besides his own choices.  Such an agent can still fulfill the criterion set out by Swinburne for being perfectly free.  God’s immutable action is brought about by his own choice at a time, and his choice is not brought about by any previous things, including previous choices.  Swinburne is right that God’s past choices would bring about his present actions (being immutable, God’s choices can’t change, so the past choices are identical with the present choices), but he is wrong in thinking that his choice is brought about by previous things.  For the choice of a temporal, immutable God is everlastingly the exact same (if God goes from choosing one thing to not choosing that thing, he is not immutable).  God’s action is everlastingly the same, and everlastingly brought about by God’s choice, which is also everlastingly the same.  God’s course of action is, as Swinburne says, fixed by past choices, but those past choices are identical with the current choices, and the choices are not brought about by anything else.  So such a being will fulfill the definition of what it is to be perfectly free.

One might also think that personhood requires rationality, consciousness, the ability to communicate, and being self-conscious (William Mann, 1983, p 269-272). Notice that none of these properties are inconsistent with immutability.  Some aspects of human rationality and consciousness aren’t available for an immutable person, for example, getting angry, learning something new, or becoming aware of a situation.  That doesn’t entail that an immutable person cannot be rational or conscious at all.  Rather, it means that the aspects of rationality or consciousness that require temporal change are ruled out.  But an immutable God can still be aware of what Moses does, still respond in a way we can call wrathful, and still love Moses.  Such actions are clear cases of rationality and consciousness and none of them require, as a necessary condition, change in the agent.

e. Immutability, Time, and Freedom

Suppose that God is in time, but immutable.  That means his knowledge can’t change over time, as discussed in a previous objection.  So anything God knows now, he knew a thousand years ago.  And here’s one thing that God knows now: what I freely chose to eat for breakfast yesterday.  I know such a truth, so God can’t be ignorant of it.  Given immutability, God can’t go from not knowing it to knowing it.  So he has everlastingly known it.  Similarly for all other truths.  In general, God knows what we are going to do before we do it.

If God knows before I act that I am going to act in that way, then I can’t do anything but act in that way.  And if, for every one of my actions, I can’t do otherwise, then I can’t be free.  Put another way, God’s knowledge ten thousand years ago that I would do thus-and-such entails that now I do thus-and-such.  And that’s true of all my actions.  So God’s knowledge determines all of my actions.

The proponent of an eternal, immutable God doesn’t face this problem, since on that view God doesn’t, strictly speaking, know anything before anything else.  Likewise, someone who denies immutability may get around this objection by affirming that God changes to learn new facts as time marches on.  But the defender of a temporal, immutable God has neither of these options available.

One response open to the defender of a temporal, immutable God is to embrace the view, presented above in section 3.a, that immutability doesn’t rule out extrinsic change, and gaining or losing knowledge is extrinsic change.  The benefits and costs of this view were discussed above.

Another response would be to argue that there is an asymmetry between truths and the world which allows for prior logical determination not to render a posterior action unfree. Truths are true because reality is as it is, and not the other way around.  So the truth of God’s knowledge that I do thus-and-such is because I do thus-and-such, and not the converse.  In order to get unfree action, one must have one’s actions be done because of something else, such as force.  Since the dependence of truth on reality requires the “because of” relations to run the other way, actions entailed by the truth of earlier truths do not render such actions unfree. ( Trenton Merricks, 2009; see also Kevin Timpe, 2007).

A final response is to claim that God knows all the actions that I will do, and he knew them far before I do actually perform those actions, but, were I to freely do something else, he would have known differently than he does.  This answer requires backwards counterfactual dependence of God’s knowledge on future actions.  But it doesn’t, at least without much argument, require backwards causation. This view is known as Ockham’s Way Out, and was popularized in an article by Alvin Plantinga (1986) entitled, aptly, “On Ockham’s Way Out.”

4. Related Issues

There are both philosophical and theological issues related to divine immutability.  Some theological issues include the relationship between immutability and other attributes and the consistency of God becoming man yet being strongly immutable.  As for philosophically related issues, one is the issue discussed above in section 3.e: the issue of (theological) determinism and free will.  Another relevant issue is the distinction, so important to Leftow’s understanding of immutability (see section 3.a), between intrinsic and extrinsic properties.

a. Divine Timelessness or Eternality

As is clear from the responses to some objections in section 3, supposing that God is outside of time has some advantages when it comes to answering objections to divine immutability (Mann, 1983). Divine timelessness entails divine immutability, given that change has as a necessary condition time in which to change.  But running the entailment relation the other way—from immutability to timelessness—is more difficult.  If one can show that existing in time requires at least one sort of intrinsic change—if, for instance, change in age or duration of existence is intrinsic change—then one can argue that immutability and temporality are inconsistent (Leftow, 2004). For arguments from immutability to timelessness, see Leftow (2004).

b. Divine Impassibility

Divine impassibility is the claim that God cannot have affects, or be affected by things.  Paul Gavrilyuk describes it as follows:

[T]hat [God] does not have the same emotions as the gods of the heathen; that his care for human beings is free from self-interest and any association with evil; that since he has neither body nor soul, he cannot directly have the experiences typically connected with them; that he is not overwhelmed by emotions and in the incarnation emerges victorious over suffering and death (Gavrilyuk (2004) 15-16; for other definitions of the term, see Creel (1986) 3-10).

Notice that impassibility, as so described, doesn’t entail immutability.  An agent can be impassible in the sense described by Gavrilyuk but still mutable.  He can, for instance, change in going from not promising to promising and be impassible.  Likewise, an immutable God can be passible.  He can be continually undergoing an emotion without change—for instance, he could be continually feeling the sorrow over human sin without change (Leftow, 2004). Neither entails the other. Nevertheless, they are closely related and often discussed in tandem.

c. The Incarnation

The incarnation is the doctrine, central to Christianity, that the Son of God, the Second Person of the Trinity, assumed a full human nature (that is, all that there is to a human), and became man.  Thus the one divine person had two natures—one divine, and one human, each with its own intellect and will, and these two natures didn’t mix together or exclude one another.  For the most important traditional expression of this doctrine, see the council of Chalcedon.  (Though it must be said that the doctrine wasn’t fully developed—in particular, the parts about Christ having two wills—until later councils.)

The incarnation raises questions concerning the immutability of God insofar as in the incarnation the Second Person of the Trinity becomes a man, and becoming, at least on the face of it, appears to involve change.  So the incarnation, it has been argued, is inconsistent with divine immutability.

This is not the place to go into a theological discussion of the consistency of the two teachings.  One should note, however, that the very church fathers and councils that teach that Christ’s two natures didn’t change one another or mix together, provide as evidence, as we saw in sections 1.b and 2, that God is absolutely unchangeable by his very nature.  So the principle of charity dictates that if we do find ourselves understanding immutability and the incarnation such that there is an explicit, obvious contradiction between them, noticeable by the merest reflection upon the two doctrines, the chances are that it is our understanding, and not the traditional doctrine's, that is at fault. To see more on the relationship between the incarnation and immutability, see Richards (2003) p 209-210 and Dodds (1986) p 272-277.  Stump (2003) chapter 14 is helpful here as well.  Also, see Weinandy (1985), which is a book-length discussion of this very question.

d. Intrinsic/Extrinsic Properties

The distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties is important to the discussion of divine immutability because there needs to be a way to distinguish between the predications concerning God which can change in truth-value without precluding divine immutability and those that can’t.  This was discussed in sections 2.b and 3.a.  Divine immutability is compromised if that God is planning to redeem creation changes in truth-value, but it is not compromised if that God is being praised by Father Jones changes in truth-value.  The difference between propositions of these two sorts is often spelled out in terms of intrinsic and extrinsic properties (oftentimes extrinsic changes are called Cambridge changes).  God’s plans are intrinsic to God, but his being praised is extrinsic to him (unless he is praising himself).

5. References and Further Reading

  • Brower, Jeffrey. “Making Sense of Divine Simplicity”. Faith and Philosophy 25(1) 2008. p 3-30.
  • Creel, Richard. Divine Impassibility. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1986.
  • Denby, David. “The Distinction between Intrinsic and Extrinsic Properties”. Mind: A Quarterly Review of Philosophy 115(457) 2006. p 1-17.
  • Dodds, Michael. The Unchanging God of Love: a Study of the Teaching of St. Thomas Aquinas on Divine Immutability in View of Certain Contemporary Criticism of This Doctrine. Fribourg: Editions Universitaires, 1986.
    • This book provides a detailed and historical look at Thomas Aquinas’ understanding of immutability, as well as defending it against objections.
  • Dorner, I. and Robert Williams. Divine Immutability. Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 1994.
    • This is an important work on immutability by a 19th century theologian, which receives more attention in theological than in philosophical contexts.
  • Gavrilyuk, Paul. The Suffering of the Impassible God. Oxford Oxfordshire: Oxford University Press, 2004.
    • This is a good, recent discussion of divine impassibility.
  • Kretzmann, Norman. “Omniscience and Immutability”. Journal of Philosophy 63(14) 1966. p 409-421.
  • Leftow, Brian.  “Eternity and Immutability.” The Blackwell Guide to Philosophy of Religion.  Mann, William E.  Blackwell Publishing, 2004.
    • This is an excellent article on divine immutability and eternality from a philosophical viewpoint.
  • Leftow, Brian. “Immutability”. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2008 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).
    • This, too, is an excellent article on divine immutability from a philosophical viewpoint.
  • Leftow, Brian. Time and Eternity. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991.
    • This book provides a technical, extended discussion of divine eternality, its entailments, and arguments for and against it.
  • Mann, William. “Simplicity and Immutability in God”. International Philosophical Quarterly 23, 1983. p 267-276.
    • This article argues that divine immutability is best understood in the light of divine eternality and simplicity.  It also includes a nice discussion of immutability and personhood.
  • Merricks, Trenton.  “Truth and Freedom”. Philosophical Review 118(1), 2009. p 29-57.
  • Perry, John. “The Problem of the Essential Indexical”. Noûs 13, 1979. p 3-21.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. “On Ockham's Way Out”. Faith and Philosophy 3(3) 1986. p 235-269.
  • Pohle, Joseph and Arthur Preuss.  God: His Knowability, Essence, and Attributes.  St. Louis, MO: Herder Book Co, 1946.
    • This is volume from a standard dogmatic set, which contains biblical, patristic, and philosophical arguments for Catholic dogmas.
  • Richards, Jay. The Untamed God. Downers Grove: InterVarsity Press, 2003.
    • This book is about divine immutability and simplicity.  It is written at a good level for a beginner, but contains discussion useful for advanced readers as well.
  • Schaff, Philip.  The Creeds of Christendom: The Evangelical Protestant Creeds, with Translations. Harper, 1877.
    • This is a useful collection of confessional statements from the protestant reformers and their successors.
  • Stump, Eleonore. Aquinas. New York: Routledge, 2003.
    • An excellent discussion of Aquinas’s philosophy, which includes extended discussions of divine responsiveness, immutability, simplicity, and eternality.
  • Stump, Eleonore, and Norman Kretzmann, "Eternity". Journal of Philosophy 78, 1981. p 429-458.
    • A seminal article on the relationship between time and God.
  • Sullivan, Thomas D.  "Omniscience, Immutability, and the Divine Mode of Knowing". Faith and Philosophy 8(1) 1991. p 21-35.
  • Swinburne, Richard. The Coherence of Theism. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1993.
  • Tanner, Norman. Decrees of the Ecumenical Councils. Franklin: Sheed & Ward, 1990.
    • An excellent two volume work which contains the decrees of the councils in the original languages, with facing translations.
  • Timpe, Kevin. “Truthmaking and Divine Eternity”. Religious Studies 43(3) 2007. p 299-315.
  • Weinandy, Thomas. Does God Change?. Still River: St. Bede's Publications, 1985.
    • This book is an interesting historical discussion of what it means to say that God is immutable but became man.
  • Williams, Robert R., “I. A Dorner: The Ethical Immutability of God”. Journal of the American Academy of Religion 54(4), 1986. p 721-738.

Author Information

Tim Pawl
University of Saint Thomas
U. S. A.

Liar Paradox

The Liar Paradox is an argument that arrives at a contradiction by reasoning about a Liar Sentence. The Classical Liar Sentence is the self-referential sentence, “This sentence is false,” which leads to the same difficulties as the sentence, “I am lying.”

Experts in the field of philosophical logic have never agreed on the way out of the trouble despite 2,300 years of attention. Here is the trouble—a sketch of the Liar Argument that reveals the contradiction:

Let L be the Classical Liar Sentence. If L is true, then L is false. But we can also establish the converse, as follows. Assume L is false. Because the Liar Sentence is just the sentence that ‘says’ L is false, the Liar Sentence is therefore true, so L is true. We have now shown that L is true if, and only if, it is false. Since L must be one or the other, it is both.

That contradictory result apparently throws us into the lion’s den of semantic incoherence. The incoherence is due to the fact that, according to the rules of classical logic, anything follows from a contradiction, even "1 + 1 = 3." This article explores the details and implications of the principal ways out of the Paradox, ways of restoring semantic coherence.

Most people, when first encountering the Liar Paradox, react in one of two ways. One reaction is to not take the Paradox seriously and say they won't reason any more about it. The second and more popular reaction is to say the Liar Sentence must be meaningless. Both of these reactions are a way out of the Paradox. That is, they stop the argument of the Paradox. However, the first reaction provides no useful diagnosis of the problem that was caused in the first place. The second is not an adequate solution if it can answer the question, “Why is the Liar Sentence meaningless?”  only with the ad hoc remark, “Otherwise we get a paradox.” An adequate solution should offer a more systematic treatment. For example, the self-referential English sentence, “This sentence is not in Italian,” is very similar to the Liar Sentence. Is it meaningless, too?  Apparently not. So, what feature of the Liar Sentence makes it be meaningless while “This sentence is not in Italian,” is not meaningless? The questions continue, and an adequate solution should address them systematically.

Table of Contents

  1. History of the Paradox
    1. Strengthened Liar
    2. Why the Paradox is a Serious Problem
    3. Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem
  2. Overview of Ways Out of the Paradox
    1. Five Ways Out
    2. Sentences, Statements, and Propositions
    3. An Ideal Solution to the Paradox
    4. Should Classical Logic be Revised?
  3. The Main Ways Out
    1. Russell’s Type Theory
    2. Tarski’s Hierarchy of Meta-Languages
    3. Kripke’s Hierarchy of Interpretations
    4. Barwise and Etchemendy
    5. Paraconsistency
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History of the Paradox

Languages are expected to contain contradictions but not paradoxes. The sentence, “Snow is white, and snow is not white,” is just one of the many false sentences in the English language. But languages are not expected to contain paradoxes. A paradox is an apparently convincing argument leading to the conclusion that one of the language’s contradictory sentences is true. Why is that a problem? Well, let L be the Liar sentence, and let Q be a sentence we already know cannot be true, say "1 + 1 = 3". Then we can reason this way:

1. L and not-L from the Liar Paradox
2. L from 1
3. L or Q from 2
4. not-L from 1
5. Q from 3 and 4

The consequence is outrageous. So, an appropriate reaction to any paradox is to look for some unacceptable assumption made in the apparently convincing argument or else to look for a faulty step in the reasoning. Only very reluctantly would one want to learn to live with the contradiction being true, or ignore the contradiction altogether. By the way, paradoxes are commonly called "antinomies," although some authors prefer to save the word "antinomies" for only the more difficult paradoxes to resolve.

Zeno's Paradoxes were discovered in the 5th century B.C.E., and the Liar Paradox was discovered in the middle of the 4th century B.C.E., both in ancient Greece. The most ancient attribution of the Liar is to Eubulides of Miletus who included it among a list of seven puzzles. He said, “A man says that he is lying. Is what he says true or false?” Eubulides’ commentary on his puzzle has not been found. An ancient gravestone on the Greek Island of Kos was reported by Athenaeus to contain this poem about the difficulty of solving the Paradox:

O Stranger: Philetas of Kos am I,

‘Twas the Liar who made me die,

And the bad nights caused thereby.

Theophrastus, Aristotle’s successor, wrote three papyrus rolls about the Liar Paradox, and the Stoic philosopher Chrysippus wrote six, but their contents are lost in the sands of time. Despite various comments on how to solve the Paradox, no Greek suggested that Greek itself was inconsistent; it was the reasoning within Greek that was considered to be inconsistent.

In the Late Medieval period in Europe, the French philosopher Jean Buridan put the Liar Paradox to devious use with the following proof of the existence of God. It uses the pair of sentences:

God exists.

None of the sentences in this pair is true.

The only consistent way to assign truth values, that is, to have these two sentence be either true or false, requires making “God exists” be true. So, in this way, Buridan has “proved” that God does exist.

There are many other versions of the Paradox. Some liar paradoxes begin with a chain of sentences, no one of which is self-referential, although the chain as a whole is self-referential or circular:

The following sentence is true.

The following sentence is true.

The following sentence is true.

The first sentence in this list is false.

There are also Contingent Liars which may or may not lead to a paradox depending on what happens in the world beyond the sentence. For example:

It’s raining and this sentence is false.

Paradoxicality now depends on the weather. If it’s sunny, then the sentence is simply false, but if it’s raining, then we have the beginning of a paradox.

a. Strengthened Liar

The Strengthened Liar Paradox begins with the Strengthened Liar Sentence

This sentence is not true.

This version is called “Strengthened” because some promising solutions to the Classical Liar Paradox beginning with (L) fail when faced with the Strengthened Liar. So, finding one’s way out of the Strengthened Liar Paradox is the acid test of a successful solution.

Here is an example of the failure just mentioned. Consider the Strengthened Liar in the context of trying to solve the Liar Paradox by declaring that the Liar Sentence L cannot be used to make a claim. It is neither true nor false. That will stop the argument of the Classical Liar Paradox involving L. But suppose this attempted solution is unsystematic and implies nothing about our various semantic principles and so implies nothing about the Strengthened Liar Sentence. If so, we could use that Strengthened Liar Sentence to create a new paradox by asking for its truth value. If it were to be true it would not be true. But if it were not true, then it would therefore be true, and so we have arrived at a contradiction. That is why we want any solution which says that the Classical Liar Sentence L has no truth value to be systematic enough that it can be applied to the Strengthened Liar Sentence and show that it, too, has no truth value. That way, we do not solve the Classical Liar only to be ensnared by the Strengthened Liar.

b. Why the Paradox is a Serious Problem

To put the Liar Paradox in perspective, it is essential to appreciate why such an apparently trivial problem is a deep problem. Solving the Liar Paradox is part of the larger project of understanding truth. Understanding truth involves finding a theory of truth or a definition of truth or a proper analysis of the concept of truth; many researchers do not carefully distinguish these projects from each other.

Aristotle offered what most philosophers consider to be a correct proposal. Stripped of his overtones suggesting a correspondence theory of truth, Aristotle proposed (in Metaphysics 1011 b26) what is now called a precursor to Alfred Tarski's Convention T:

(T) A sentence is true if, and only if, what it says is so.

Here we need to take some care with the use-mention distinction. If pairs of quotation marks serve to name or mention a sentence, then the above is requiring that the sentence “It is snowing” be true just in case it is snowing. Similarly, if the sentence about snow were named not with quotation marks but with the numeral 88 inside a pair of parentheses, then (88) would be true just in case it is snowing. What could be less controversial about the nature of truth? Unfortunately, this is neither obviously correct nor trivial; and the resolution of the difficulty is still an open problem in philosophical logic. Why is that? The brief answer is that (T) can be used to produce the Liar Paradox. The longer answer refers to Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem of 1936.

c. Tarski’s Undefinability Theorem

tarskiThis article began with a mere sketch of the Liar Argument using sentence (L). To appreciate the central role of (T) in the argument, we need to examine more than just a sketch of the argument. Alfred Tarski proposed a more formal characterization of (T), which is called schema T or Convention T:

(T) X is true if, and only if, p,

where “p” is a variable for a grammatical sentence and “X” is a name for that sentence. Tarski was the first person to claim that any theory of truth that could not entail all sentences of this schema would fail to be an adequate theory of truth. Here is what Tarski is requiring. If we want to build a theory of truth for English, and we want to state the theory using English, then the theory must entail the T-sentence:

“Snow is white” is true if, and only if, snow is white.

If we want instead to build a theory of truth for German and use English to state the theory, then the theory should, among other things, at least entail the T-sentence:

“Der Schnee ist weiss” is true in German if, and only if, snow is white.

A great many philosophers believe Tarski is correct when he claims his Convention T is a necessary condition on any successful theory of truth for any language. However, do we want all the T-sentences to be entailed and thus come out true? Probably not the T-sentence for the Liar Sentence. That T-sentence has the logical form: T`s´ if and only if s.  Here T is the truth predicate, and s is the Liar Sentence, namely ~T`s´. Substituting the latter for s on the right of the biconditional yields the contradiction: T`s´ if and only if ~T`s´. That is the argument of the Liar Paradox, very briefly. Tarski wanted to find a way out.

Tarski added precision to the discussion of the Liar by focusing not on a natural language but on a classical, interpreted, formal language capable of expressing arithmetic. Here the difficulties produced by the Liar Argument became much clearer; and, very surprisingly, he was able to prove that Convention T plus the assumption that the language contains its own concept of truth do lead to semantic incoherence.

The proof requires the following assumptions in addition to Convention T. Here we quote from (Tarski 1944):

I. We have implicitly assumed that the language in which the antinomy is constructed contains, in addition to its expressions, also the names of these expressions, as well as semantic terms such as the term "true" referring to sentences of this language; we have also assumed that all sentences which determine the adequate usage of this term can be asserted in the language. A language with these properties will be called "semantically closed."

II. We have assumed that in this language the ordinary laws of logic hold.

Tarski pointed out that the crucial, unacceptable assumption of the formal version of the Liar Argument is that the language is semantically closed. For there to be a grammatical and meaningful Liar Sentence in that language, there must be a definable notion of “is true” which holds for the true sentences and fails to hold for the other sentences. If there were such a global truth predicate, then the predicate “is a false sentence” would also be definable; and [here is where we need the power of elementary number theory] a Liar Sentence would exist, namely a complex sentence ∃x(Qx & ~Tx), where Q and T are predicates which are satisfied by names of sentences. More specifically, T is the one-place, global truth predicate satisfied by all the names [that is, numerals for the Gödel numbers] of the true sentences, and Q is a one-place predicate that is satisfied only by the name of ∃x(Qx & ~Tx). But if so, then one can eventually deduce a contradiction. This deduction of Tarski’s is a formal analog of the informal argument of the Liar Paradox. The contradictory result tells us that the argument began with a false assumption. According to Tarski, the error that causes the contradiction is the assumption that the global truth predicate can be well-defined. Therefore, Tarski has proved that truth is not definable within a classical formal language—thus the name “Undefinability Theorem.” Tarski’s Theorem establishes that classically interpreted languages capable of expressing arithmetic cannot contain a global truth predicate. So his theorem implies that classical formal languages with the power to express arithmetic cannot be semantically closed.

There is no special difficulty is giving a careful definition of truth for a classical formal language, provided we do it outside the language; and Tarski himself was the first person to do this. In 1933 he created the first formal semantics for quantified predicate logic. Here are two imperfect examples of how he defines truth. First, the simple sentence 'Fa' is true if, and only if, a is a member of the set of objects that are F. Notice that the crucial fact that the English truth predicate "is true" occurring in the definition of truth for the formal language does not also occur in the formal language. The formal language being examined, that is, being given a theory of truth, is what Tarski calls the "object language." For a second example of defining truth, Tarski says the universally quantified sentence '∀xFx' is true if, and only if, all the objects are members of the set of objects that are F. To repeat, a little more precisely but still imperfectly, Tarski's theory implies that, if we have a simple, formal sentence `Fa´ in our formal language, in which ` is the name of some object in the domain of discourse (that is, what we can talk about) and if ` is a predicate designating a property that perhaps some of those objects have, then `Fa´ is true in the object language if, and only if, a is a member of the set of all things having property F. For the more complex sentence `∀xFx´ in our language, it is true just in case every object is a member of the set of all things having property F. These two definitions are still imprecise because the appeal to the concept of property should be eliminated, and the definitions should appeal to the notion of formulas being satisfied by sequences of objects. However, what we have here are two examples of partially defining truth for the object language, say language 0, but doing it from outside language 0, in a meta-language, say language 1, that contains set theory and that might or might not contain language 0 itself. Tarski was able to show that in language 1 we satisfy Convention T for the object language 0, because the equivalences

`Fa´ is true in language 0 if, and only if, Fa

`∀xFx´ is true in language 0 if, and only if, ∀xFx

are both deducible in language 1, as are the other T-sentences.

Despite Tarski's having this success with defining truth for an object language in its meta-language, Tarski's Undefinability Theorem establishes that there is apparently no hope of defining truth within the object language itself. Tarski then took on the project of discovering how close he could come to having a well-defined truth predicate within a classical formal language without actually having one. That project, his hierarchy of meta-languages, is also his key idea for solving the Liar Paradox. It will be discussed in a moment.

2. Overview of Ways Out of the Paradox

a. Five Ways Out

We should avoid having to solve the Liar Paradox merely by declaring that our logic obeys the principle "Avoid paradoxes." That gives us no guidance about how to avoid them. Since the Liar Paradox depends crucially upon our rules of making inferences and on the key semantic concepts of truth, reference, and negation, one might reasonably suppose that one of these rules or concepts needs revision. No one wants to solve the Paradox by being heavy-handed and jettisoning more than necessary.

Where should we make the changes? If we adopt the metaphor of a paradox as being an argument which starts from the home of seemingly true assumptions and which travels down the garden path of seemingly valid steps into the den of a contradiction, then a solution to the Liar Paradox has to find something wrong with the home, find something wrong with the garden path, or find a way to live within the den. Less metaphorically, the main ways out of the Paradox are the following:

  1. The Liar Sentence is ungrammatical and so has no truth value (yet the argument of the Liar Paradox depends on it having a truth value).
  2. The Liar Sentence is grammatical but meaningless and so has no truth value.
  3. The Liar Sentence is grammatical and meaningful but still it has no truth value; it falls into the “truth gap.”
  4. The Liar Sentence is grammatical, meaningful and has a truth value, but one other step in the argument of the Liar Paradox is faulty.
  5. The argument of the Liar Paradox is acceptable, and we need to learn how to live with the Liar Sentence being both true and false.

Two philosophers might take the same way out, but for different reasons.

There are many suggestions for how to deal with the Liar Paradox, but most are never developed to the point of giving a formal, detailed theory that can speak of its own syntax and semantics with precision. Some give philosophical arguments for why this or that conceptual reform is plausible as a way out of paradox, but then don’t show that their ideas can be carried through in a rigorous way. Other attempts at solutions will take the formal route and then require changes in standard formalisms so that a formal analog of the Liar Paradox’s argument fails, but then the attempted solution offers no philosophical argument to back up these formal changes. A decent theory of truth showing the way out of the Liar Paradox requires both a coherent formalism (or at least a systematic theory of some sort) and a philosophical justification backing it up. The point of the philosophical justification is an unveiling of some hitherto unnoticed or unaccepted rule of language for all sentences of some category which has been violated by the argument of the Paradox.

The leading solutions to the Liar Paradox, that is, the influential proposed solutions, all have a common approach, the “systematic approach.” The developers of these solutions agree that the Liar Paradox represents a serious challenge to our understanding the concepts, rules, and logic of natural language; and they agree that we must go back and systematically reform or clarify some of our original beliefs, and provide a motivation for doing so other than that doing so blocks the Paradox.

This need to have a systematic approach has been seriously challenged by Ludwig Wittgenstein (in 1938 in a discussion group with Alan Turing on the foundations of mathematics). He says one should try to overcome ”the superstitious fear and dread of mathematicians in the face of a contradiction.” The proper way to respond to any paradox, he says, is by an ad hoc reaction and not by any systematic treatment designed to cure both it and any future ills. Symptomatic relief is sufficient. It may appear legitimate, at first, to admit that the Liar Sentence is meaningful and also that it is true or false, but the Liar Paradox shows that one should retract this admission and either just not use the Liar Sentence in any arguments, or say it is not really a sentence, or at least say it is not one that is either true or false. Wittgenstein is not particularly concerned with which choice is made. And, whichever choice is made, it need not be backed up by any theory that shows how to systematically incorporate the choice. He treats the whole situation cavalierly and unsystematically. After all, he says, the language can’t really be incoherent because we have been successfully using it all along, so why all this “fear and dread”? Most logicians want systematic removal of the Paradox, but Wittgenstein is content to say that we may need to live with this paradox and to agree never to utter the Liar Sentence, especially if it seems that removal of the contradiction could have worse consequences.

P. F. Strawson has promoted the performative theory of truth as a way out of the Liar Paradox. Strawson has argued that the proper way out of the Liar Paradox is to carefully re-examine how the term “truth” is really used by speakers. He says such an investigation will reveal that the Liar Sentence is meaningful but fails to express a proposition. To explore this response more deeply, notice that Strawson’s proposed solution depends on the distinction between a proposition and the declarative sentence used to express that proposition. The next section explores what a proposition is, but let's agree for now that a sentence, when uttered, either expresses a true proposition, expresses a false proposition, or fails to express any proposition. According to Strawson, when we say some proposition is true, we are not making a statement about the proposition. We are not ascribing a property to the proposition such as the property of correspondence to the facts, or coherence, or usefulness. Rather, when we call a proposition “true,” we are only approving it, or praising it, or admitting it, or condoning it. We are performing an action of that sort. Similarly, when we say to our friend, “I promise to pay you fifty dollars,” we are not ascribing some property to the proposition, “I pay you fifty dollars.” Rather, we are performing the act of promising the $50. For Strawson, when speakers utter the Liar Sentence, they are attempting to praise a proposition that is not there, as if they were saying “Ditto” when no one has spoken. The person who utters the Liar Sentence is making a pointless utterance. According to this performative theory, the Liar Sentence is grammatical, but it is not being used to express a proposition and so is not something from which a contradiction can be derived.

b. Sentences, Statements, and Propositions

The Liar Paradox can be expressed in terms of sentences, statements, or propositions. We appropriately speak of the sentence, “This sentence is false,” and of the statement that this statement is false, and of the proposition that this proposition is false. Sentences are linguistic expressions whereas statements and propositions are not. When speaking about sentences, we are nearly always speaking about sentence types, not tokens. A token is the sound waves or the ink marks; these are specific collections of molecules. Philosophers do not agree on what a sentence is, but they disagree more about what a statement is, and they disagree even more about what a proposition is.

Despite Quine's famous complaint that there are no propositions because there can be no precise criteria for deciding whether two different sentences are being used to express identical propositions, there are some good reasons why researchers who work on the Liar Paradox should focus on propositions rather than either sentences or statements, but those reasons will not be explored here. [For a discussion, see (Barwise and Etchemendy 1987).] The present article will continue to speak primarily of sentences rather than propositions, though only for the purpose of simplicity.

c. An Ideal Solution to the Liar Paradox

We expect that any seriously proposed solution to the Liar Paradox will offer a better diagnosis of the problem than merely, “It stops the Liar Paradox.” A solution which says, “Quit using language” also will stop the Liar Paradox, but the Liar Paradox can be stopped by making more conservative changes than this. Hopefully any proposal to refine our semantic principles will be conservative for another reason: We want to minimize the damage; we want to minimize the amount and drastic nature of the changes because, all other things being equal, simple and intuitive semantic principles are to be preferred to complicated and less intuitive semantic principles. The same goes for revision of a concept or revision of a logic.

Ideally, we would like for a proposed solution to the Liar Paradox to provide a solution to all the versions of the Liar Paradox, such as the Strengthened Liar Paradox, the version that led to Buridan’s proof of God’s existence, and the contingent versions of the Liar Paradoxes. The solution should solve the paradox both for natural languages and formal languages, or provide a good explanation of why the paradox can be treated properly only in a formal language. The contingent versions of the Liar Paradox are going to be especially troublesome because if the production of the paradox doesn't depend only on something intrinsic to the sentence but also depends on what circumstances occur in the world, then there needs to be a detailed description of when those circumstances are troublesome and when they are not, and why.

It would be reasonable to expect a solution to tell us about the self-referential Truth-teller sentence:

This sentence is true.

It would also be reasonable to tell us how important self-reference is to the Liar Paradox. In the late 20th century, Stephen Yablo produced a semantic paradox that, he claims, shows that neither self-reference nor circularity is an essential feature of all the Liar paradoxes. In his paradox, there apparently is no way to coherently assign a truth value to any of the sentences in the countably infinite sequence of sentences of the form, “None of the subsequent sentences are true.” Imagine an unending line of people who say:

1. Everybody after me is lying.

2. Everybody after me is lying.

3. Everybody after me is lying.


Ask yourself whether the first person's sentence in the sequence is true or false. Notice that no sentence overtly refers to itself. To produce the paradox it is crucial that the line of speakers be infinite. There is controversy in the literature about whether the paradox actually contains a hidden appeal to self-reference or circularity. See (Beall 2001) for more discussion.

An important goal for the best solution, or solutions, to the Liar Paradox is to offer us a deeper understanding of how our semantic concepts and principles worked to produce the Paradox in the first place, especially if a solution to the Paradox requires changing or at least clarifying them. We want to understand the concepts of truth, reference, and negation that are involved in the Paradox. In addition to these, there are the subsidiary principles and related notions of denial, definability, naming, meaning, predicate, property, presupposition, antecedent, and operating on prior sentences to form newer meaningful ones rather than merely newer grammatical ones. We would like to know what limits there are on all these notions and mechanisms, and how one impacts another.

What are the important differences among the candidates for bearers of truth? The leading candidates are sentences, propositions, statements, claims, and utterances. Is one primary, while the others are secondary or derivative? And we would like know a great deal more about truth, especially truth, but also falsehood, and the related notions of fact, situation and state of affairs. We want to better understand what a language is and what the relationship is between an interpreted formal language and a natural language, relative to different purposes. Finally, it would be instructive to learn how the Liar Paradoxes are related to all the other paradoxes. That may be a lot of ask, but then our civilization does have considerable time before the Sun expands and vaporizes our little planet.

d. Should Classical Logic be Revised?

An important question regarding the Liar Paradox is: What is the relationship between a solution to the Paradox for (interpreted) formal languages and a solution to the Paradox for natural languages? There is significant disagreement on this issue. Is appeal to a formal language a turn away from the original problem, and so just changing the subject? Can one say we are still on the subject when employing a formal language because a natural language contains implicitly within it some formal language structure? Or should we be in the business of building an ideal language to replace natural language for the purpose of philosophical study?

Do we always reason informally in a semantically closed language, namely ordinary English? Or is it not clear what logic there is in English, and perhaps we should conclude from the Liar Paradox that the logic of English cannot be standard logic but must be one that restricts the explosion that occurs due to our permitting the deduction of anything whatsoever from a contradiction? Should we say English really has truth gaps or perhaps occasional truth gluts (sentences that are both true and false)?

Or instead can a formal language be defended on the ground that natural language is inconsistent and the formal language is showing the best that can be done rigorously? Can sense even be made of the claim that a natural language is inconsistent, for is not consistency a property only of languages with a rigorous structure, namely formal languages and not natural languages? Should we say people can reason inconsistently in natural language without declaring the natural language itself to be inconsistent? This article raises, but will not resolve, these questions, although some are easier to answer than others.

Many of the most important ways out of the Liar Paradox recommend revising classical formal logic. Classical logic is the formal logic known to introductory logic students as "predicate logic" in which, among other things, (i) all sentences of the formal language have exactly one of two possible truth values (TRUE, FALSE), (ii) the rules of inference allow one to deduce any sentence from an inconsistent set of assumptions, (iii) all predicates are totally defined on the range of the variables, and (iv) the formal semantics is the one invented by Tarski that provided the first precise definition of truth for a formal language in its metalanguage. A few philosophers of logic argue against any revision of classical logic by saying it is the incumbent formalism that should be accepted unless an alternative is required (probably it is believed to be incumbent because of its remarkable success in expressing most of modern mathematical inference). Still, most other philosophers argue that classical logic is not the incumbent which must remain in office unless an opponent can dislodge it. Instead, the office has always been vacant (for the purpose of examining natural language and its paradoxes).

Some philosophers object to revising classical logic if the purpose in doing so is merely to find a way out of the Paradox. They say that philosophers shouldn’t build their theories by attending to the queer cases. There are more pressing problems in the philosophy of logic and language than finding a solution to the Paradox, so any treatment of it should wait until these problems have a solution. From the future resulting theory which solves those problems, one could hope to deduce a solution to the Liar Paradox. However, for those who believe the Paradox is not a minor problem but is one deserving of immediate attention, there can be no waiting around until the other problems of language are solved. Perhaps the investigation of the Liar Paradox will even affect the solutions to those other problems.

3. The Main Ways Out

There have been many systematic proposals for ways out of the Liar Paradox. Below is a representative sample of five of the main ways out.

a. Russell’s Type Theory

Bertrand Russell said natural language is incoherent, but its underlying sensible part is an ideal formal language (such as the applied predicate logic of Principia Mathematica). He agreed with Henri Poincaré that the source of the Liar trouble is its use of self-reference. Russell wanted to rule out self-referential sentences as being ungrammatical or not well-formed in his ideal language, and in this way solve the Liar Paradox.

In 1908 in his article “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types” that is reprinted in (Russell 1956, p. 79), Russell solves the Liar with his ramified theory of types. This is a formal language involving an infinite hierarchy of, among other things, orders of propositions:

If we now revert to the contradictions, we see at once that some of them are solved by the theory of types. Whenever ‘all propositions’ are mentioned, we must substitute ‘all propositions of order n’, where it is indifferent what value we give to n, but it is essential that n should have some value. Thus when a man says ‘I am lying’, we must interpret him as meaning: ‘There is a proposition of order n, which I affirm, and which is false’. This is a proposition of order n+1; hence the man is not affirming any propositions of order n; hence his statement is false, and yet its falsehood does not imply, as that of ‘I am lying’ appeared to do, that he is making a true statement. This solves the liar.

Russell’s implication is that the informal Liar Sentence is meaningless because it has no appropriate translation into his formal language since an attempted translation violates his type theory. This theory is one of his formalizations of the Vicious-Circle Principle: Whatever involves all of a collection must not be one of the collection. Russell believed that violations of this principle are the root of all the logical paradoxes.

His solution to the Liar Paradox has the drawback that it places so many subscript restrictions on what can refer to what. It is unfortunate that the Russell hierarchy requires even the apparently harmless self-referential sentences “This sentence is in English” and "This sentence is not in Italian" to be syntactically ill-formed. The type theory also rules out saying that legitimate terms must have a unique type, or that properties have the property of belonging to exactly one category in the hierarchy of types, which, if we step outside the theory of types, seems to be true about the theory of types. Bothered by this, Tarski took a different approach to the Liar Paradox.

b. Tarski’s Hierarchy of Meta-Languages

Reflection on the Liar Paradox suggests that either informal English (or any other natural language) is not semantically closed or, if it is semantically closed as it appears to be, then it is inconsistent—assuming for the moment that it does make sense to apply the term "inconsistent" to a natural language with a vague structure. Because of the vagueness of natural language, Tarski quit trying to find the paradox-free structure within natural languages and concentrated on developing formal languages that did not allow the deduction of a contradiction, but which diverge from natural language "as little as possible." Tarski emphasized that we should not be investigating a language-unspecific concept of truth, but only truth for a specific formal language. Many other philosophers of logic have not drawn Tarski’s pessimistic conclusion (about not being able to solve the Liar Paradox for natural language). W. V. O. Quine, in particular, argued that informal English can be considered to implicitly contain the hierarchy of Tarski’s metalanguages. This hierarchy is the tool Tarski used to solve the Liar Paradox for formal languages, although he gave no other justification for distinguishing a language from its metalanguage.

One virtue of Tarski's way out of the Paradox is that it does permit the concept of truth to be applied to sentences that involve the concept of truth, provided we apply level subscripts to the concept of truth and follow the semantic rule that any subscript inside, say, a pair of quotation marks is smaller than the subscript outside; any violation of this rule produces a meaningless, ungrammatical formal sentence, but not a false one. The language of level 1 is the meta-language of the object language in level 0. The (semi-formal) sentence "I0 am not true0" violates the subscript rule, as does "I1 am not true1" and so on up the numbered hierarchy. `I0´ is the name of the sentence "I0 am not true0," which is the obvious candidate for being the Strengthened Liar Sentence in level 0, the lowest level. The rule for subscripts stops the formation of either the Classical Liar sentence or the Strengthened Liar Sentence anywhere in the hierarchy. The subscript rule permits forming the Liar-like sentence “I0 am not true1.” That sentence is the closest the Tarski hierarchy can come to having a Liar Sentence, but it is not really the intended Liar Sentence because of the equivocation with the concept of truth, and it is simply false and leads to no paradox.

Russell's solution calls “This sentence is in English” ill-formed, but Tarski's solution does not, so that is a virtue of Tarski's way out. Tarski's clever treatment of the Liar Paradox unfortunately has drawbacks: English has a single word “true,” but Tarski is replacing this with an infinite sequence of truth-like predicates, each of which is satisfied by the truths only of the language below it. Intuitively, a more global truth predicate should be expressible in the language it applies to, so Tarski’s theory cannot make formal sense of remarks such as “The Liar Sentence implies it itself is false” although informally this is a true remark. One hopes to be able to talk truly about one’s own semantic theory. Despite these restrictions and despite the unintuitive and awkward hierarchy, Quine defends Tarski's way out of the Liar Paradox as follows. Like Tarski, he prefers to speak of the Antinomy instead of the Paradox.

Revision of a conceptual scheme is not unprecedented. It happens in a small way with each advance in science, and it happens in a big way with the big advances, such as the Copernican revolution and the shift from Newtonian mechanics to Einstein's theory of relativity. We can hope in time even to get used to the biggest such changes and to find the new schemes natural. There was a time when the doctrine that the earth revolves around the sun was called the Copernican paradox, even by the men who accepted it. And perhaps a time will come when truth locutions without implicit subscripts, or like safeguards, will really sound as nonsensical as the antinomies show them to be. (Quine 1976)

 Tarski adds to the defense by stressing that:

The languages (either the formalized languages or—what is more frequently the case—the portions of everyday language) which are used in scientific discourse do not have to be semantically closed. (Tarski, 1944)

(Kripke 1975) criticized Tarski’s way out for its inability to handle contingent versions of the Liar Paradox because Tarski cannot describe the contingency. That is, Tarski's solution does not provide a way to specify the circumstances in which a sentence leads to a paradox and the other circumstances in which that same sentence is paradox-free.

Putnam criticized Tarski's way out for another reason:

The paradoxical aspect of Tarski’s theory, indeed of any hierarchical theory, is that one has to stand outside the whole hierarchy even to formulate the statement that the hierarchy exists. But what is this “outside place”—“informal language”—supposed to be? It cannot be “ordinary language,” because ordinary language, according to Tarski, is semantically closed and hence inconsistent. But neither can it be a regimented language, for no regimented language can make semantic generalizations about itself or about languages on a higher level than itself. (Putnam 1990, 13)

Within the formal languages, we cannot say, “Every language has true sentences,” even though outside the hierarchy this is clearly a true remark about the hierarchy.

c. Kripke’s Hierarchy of Interpretations

Saul Kripke was the first person to emphasize that the reasoning of ordinary speakers often can produce a Liar Paradox. Statement (1) below can do so. Quoting from (Kripke 1975), "Consider the ordinary statement, made by Jones:

(1) Most (i.e., a majority) of Nixon's assertions about Watergate are false.

Clearly, nothing is intrinsically wrong with (1), nor is it ill-formed. Ordinarily the truth value of (1) will be ascertainable through an enumeration of Nixon's Watergate-related assertions, and an assessment of each for truth or falsity. Suppose, however, that Nixon's assertions about Watergate are evenly balanced between the true and the false, except for one problematic case,

(2) Everything ones says about Watergate is true.

Suppose, in addition, that (1) is Jones's sole assertion about Watergate.... Then it requires little expertise to show that (1) and (2) are both paradoxical: they are true if and only if they are false.

The example of (1) points up an important lesson: it would be fruitless to looks for an intrinsic criterion that will enable us to sieve out—as meaningless, or ill-formed—those sentences which lead to paradox." In that last sentence, Kripke attacks the solutions of Russell and Tarski. The additional lesson to learn from Kripke's example of the Contingent Liar involving Nixon's assertions about Watergate is that if a solution to the Liar Paradox is going to say that certain assertions such as this one fail to have a truth value in some circumstances but not in all circumstances, then the solution should tell us what those circumstances are, other than saying the circumstances are those that lead to a paradox.

Kripke’s way out requires a less radical revision in our semantic principles than does the Russell solution or the Tarski-Quine solution. Kripke retains the intuition that there is a semantically coherent and meaningful Liar Sentence, but argues that it is neither true nor false and so falls into a “truth value gap.” Tarski's Undefinability Theorem does not apply to languages having sentences that are neither true nor false.

Kripke trades Russell's and Tarski's infinite complexity of languages for infinite semantic complexity of a single formal language. He rejects Tarski's infinite hierarchy of meta-languages in favor of one formal language having an infinite hierarchy of partial interpretations. Consider a formal language containing a predicate T for truth (that is, for truth-in-an interpretation, although Kripke allows the interpretation to change throughout the hierarchy). In the base level of the hierarchy, this predicate T is given an interpretation in which it is true of all sentences that do not actually contain the symbol ‘T’. The predicate T is the formal language’s only basic partially-interpreted predicate. Each step up Kripke’s semantic hierarchy is a partial interpretation of the language, and in these interpretations all the basic predicates except one must have their interpretations already fixed in the base level from which the first step up the hierarchy is taken. This one exceptional predicate T is intended to be the truth predicate for the previous lower level.

For example, at the lowest level in the hierarchy we have the (formal equivalent of the) true sentence 7 + 5 = 12. Strictly speaking it is not grammatical in English to say 7 + 5 = 12 is true. More properly we should add quotation marks and say ‘7 + 5 = 12’ is true. In Kripke’s formal language, ‘7 + 5 = 12’ is true at the base level of the hierarchy. Meanwhile, the sentence that says it is true, namely ‘T(‘7+5=12’)’, is not true at that level, although it is true at the next higher level. Unfortunately at this new level, the even more complex sentence ‘T(‘T(‘7+5=12’)’)’ is still not yet true. It will become true at the next higher level. And so goes the hierarchy of interpretations as it attributes truth to more and more sentences involving the concept of truth itself. The extension of T, that is, the class of names of sentences that satisfy T, grows but never contracts as we move up the hierarchy, and it grows by calling more true sentences true. Similarly the anti-extension of T grows but never contracts as more false sentence involving T are correctly said to be false.

Kripke says T eventually becomes a truth predicate for its own level when the interpretation-building reaches the unique lowest fixed point at a countably infinite height in the hierarchyAt a fixed point, no new sentences are declared true or false at the next level, but the language satisfies Tarski’s Convention T, so for this reason many philosophers are sympathetic to Kripke’s claim that T is a truth predicate at that point. At this fixed point, the Liar Sentence still is neither true nor false, and so falls into the truth gap, just as Kripke set out to show. In this way, the Liar Paradox is solved, the formal semantics is coherent, and many of our intuitions about semantics are preserved. Regarding our intuition that is expressed in Convention T, a virtue of Kripke's theory is that, if ‘p’ abbreviates the name of the sentence X, it follows that Tp is true (or false) just in case X is true (or false).

However, there are difficulties with Kripke's way out. The treatment of the Classical Liar stumbles on the Strengthened Liar and reveals why that paradox deserves its name.  For a discussion of why, see (Kirkham 1992, pp. 293-4).

Some critics of Kripke's theory say that in the fixed-point the Liar Sentence does not actually contain a real, total truth predicate but rather only a clever restriction on the truth predicate, and so Kripke’s Liar Sentence is not really the Liar Sentence after all; therefore we do not have here a solution to the Liar Paradox. Other philosophers would say this is not a fair criticism of Kripke's theory since Tarski's Convention T, or some other intuitive feature of our concept of truth, must be restricted in some way if we are going to have a formal treatment of truth. What can more easily be agreed upon by the critics is that Kripke's candidate for the Liar sentence falls into the truth gap in Kripke's theory at all levels of his hierarchy, so it is not true in his theory. [We are making this judgment that it is not true from within the meta-language in which sentences are properly said to be true or else not true.] However, in the object language of the theory, one cannot truthfully say this; one cannot say the Liar Sentence is not true since the candidate expression for that, namely ~Ts, is not true, but rather falls into the truth gap.

Robert Martin and Peter Woodruff created the same way out as Kripke, though a few months earlier and in less depth.

d. Barwise and Etchemendy

Another way out says the Liar Sentence is meaningful and is true or else false, but one step of the argument in the Liar Paradox is incorrect (such as the inference from the Liar Sentence’s being false to its being true). Arthur Prior, following the informal suggestions of Jean Buridan and C. S. Peirce, takes this way out and concludes that the Liar Sentence is simply false.  So do Jon Barwise and John Etchemendy, but they go on to present a detailed, formal treatment of the Paradox that depends crucially upon using propositions rather than sentences, although the details of their treatment will not be sketched here. Their treatment says the Liar Sentence is simply false on one interpretation but simply true on another interpretation, and that the argument of the Paradox improperly exploits this ambiguity. The key ambiguity is to conflate the Liar Proposition's negating itself with its denying itself. Similarly, in ordinary language we are not careful to distinguish asserting that a sentence is false and denying that it is true.

Three positive features of their solution are that (i) it is able to solve the Strengthened Liar, (ii) its propositions are always true or false, but never both, and (iii) it shows the way out of paradox both for natural language and interpreted formal language. Yet there is a price to pay. No proposition in their system can be about the whole world, and this restriction is there for no independent reason but only because otherwise we would get a paradox.

e. Paraconsistency

A more radical way out of the Paradox is to argue that the Liar Sentence is both true and false. This solution, a version of dialethism, embraces the contradiction, then tries to limit the damage that is ordinarily a consequence of that embrace. This way out changes the classical rules of semantics and allows, among other things,  the Liar Sentence to be both true and false, and it changes the syntactic rules of classical logic and revises modus ponens to prevent there being a theorem that everything follows from a contradiction: (p&¬p) ⊢ q.

This way out uses a paraconsistent logic. That solution, which was initially promoted mostly by Graham Priest, will not be developed in this article, but it succeeds in avoiding semantic incoherence while offering a formal, detailed treatment of the Paradox. A principal virtue of this treatment is that, unlike with Barwise and Etchemendy's treatment, a sentence can be about the whole world. A principal drawback of this treatment, though, is it doesn't seem to solve the Strengthened Liar Paradox and it does violence to our intuition that sentences can’t be both true and false in the same sense in the same situation. See the last paragraph of "Paradoxes of Self-Reference," for more discussion of using paraconsistency as a way out of the Liar Paradox.

4. Conclusion

Russell, Tarski, Kripke, Priest, Barwise and Etchemendy (among others) deserve credit for providing a philosophical justification for their proposed solutions while also providing a formal treatment in symbolic logic that shows in detail both the character and implications of their proposed solutions. The theories of Russell and of Quine-Tarski do solve the Strengthened Liar, but at the cost of assigning complex “levels” to the relevant sentences, although the Quine-Tarski solution does not take Russell’s radical step of ruling out all self-reference. Kripke’s elegant and careful treatment of the Classical Liar stumbles on the Strengthened Liar and reveals why that paradox deserves its name.  Barwise and Etchemendy’s way out avoids these problems, but it requires accepting the idea that no sentence can be used to say anything about the whole world including the semantics of our language. Priest’s way out requires giving up our intuition that no context-free, unambiguous sentence is both true and false.

The interesting dispute  continues over which is the best way out of the Liar Paradox—the best way to preserve the most important intuitions we have about semantics while avoiding semantic incoherence. In this vein, Hilary Putnam draws the following conclusion:

If you want to say something about the liar sentence, in the sense of being able to give final answers to the questions “Is it meaningful or not? And if it is meaningful, is it true or false? Does it express a proposition or not? Does it have a truth-value or not? And which one?” then you will always fail. In closing, let me say that even if Tarski was wrong (as I believe he was) in supposing that ordinary language is a theory and hence can be described as “consistent” or “inconsistent,” and even if Kripke and others have shown that it is possible to construct languages that contain their own truth-predicates, still, the fact remains that the totality of our desires with respect to how a truth-predicate should behave in a semantically closed language, in particular, our desire to be able to say without paradox of an arbitrary sentence in such a language that it is true, or that it is false, or that it is neither true nor false, cannot be adequately satisfied. The very act of interpreting a language that contains a liar sentence creates a hierarchy of interpretations, and the reflection that this generates does not terminate in an answer to the questions “Is the liar sentence meaningful or meaningless, or if it is meaningful, is it true or false?” (Putnam 2000)

See also Logical Paradoxes.

5. References and Further Reading

For further reading on the Liar Paradox that provides more of an introduction to it while not presupposing a strong background in symbolic logic, the author recommends the article below by Mates, plus the first chapter of the Barwise-Etchemendy book, and then chapter 9 of the Kirkham book. The rest of this bibliography is a list of contributions to research on the Liar Paradox, and all members of the list require the reader to have significant familiarity with the techniques of symbolic logic. In the formal, symbolic tradition, other important researchers in the last quarter of the 20th century were Burge, Gupta, Herzberger, McGee, Parsons, Routley, Skyrms, van Fraassen, and Yablo.

  • Barwise, Jon and John Etchemendy. The Liar: An Essay in Truth and Circularity, Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Beall, J.C. (2001). “Is Yablo’s Paradox Non-Circular?” Analysis 61, no. 3, pp. 176-87.
  • Burge, Tyler. “Semantical Paradox,” Journal of Philosophy, 76 (1979), 169-198.
  • Dowden, Bradley. “Accepting Inconsistencies from the Paradoxes,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 125-130.
  • Gupta, Anil. “Truth and Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 11 (1982), 1-60. Reprinted in Martin (1984), 175-236.
  • Herzberger, Hans. “Paradoxes of Grounding in Semantics,” Journal of Philosophy, 68 (1970), 145-167.
  • Kirkham, Richard. Theories of Truth: A Critical Introduction, MIT Press, 1992.
  • Kripke, Saul. “Outline of a Theory of Truth,” Journal of Philosophy, 72 (1975), 690-716. Reprinted in (Martin 1984).
  • Martin, Robert. The Paradox of the Liar, Yale University Press, Ridgeview Press, 1970. 2nd ed. 1978.
  • Martin, Robert. Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar Paradox, Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Martin, Robert and Peter Woodruff. “On Representing ‘True-in-L’ in L,” Philosophia, 5 (1975), 217-221.
  • Mates, Benson. “Two Antinomies,” in Skeptical Essays, The University of Chicago Press, 1981, 15-57.
  • McGee, Vann. Truth, Vagueness, and Paradox: An Essay on the Logic of Truth, Hackett Publishing, 1991.
  • Priest, Graham. “The Logic of Paradox,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8 (1979), 219-241; and “Logic of Paradox Revisited,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 153-179.
  • Priest, Graham, Richard Routley, and J. Norman (eds.). Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent, Philosophia-Verlag, 1989.
  • Prior, Arthur. “Epimenides the Cretan,” Journal of Symbolic Logic, 23 (1958), 261-266; and “On a Family of Paradoxes,” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 2 (1961), 16-32.
  • Putnam, Hilary. Realism with a Human Face, Harvard University Press, 1990.
  • Putnam, Hilary. “Paradox Revisited I: Truth.” In Gila Sher and Richard Tieszen, eds., Between Logic and Intuition: Essays in Honor of Charles Parsons, Cambridge University Press,  (2000), 3-15.
  • Quine, W. V. O. “The Ways of Paradox,” in his The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays, rev. ed., Harvard University Press, 1976.
  • Russell, Bertrand. “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types,” American Journal of Mathematics, 30 (1908), 222-262.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Logic and Knowledge: Essays 1901-1950, ed. by Robert C. Marsh, George Allen & Unwin Ltd. (1956).
  • Skyrms, Brian. “Return of the Liar: Three-valued Logic and the Concept of Truth,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 7 (1970), 153-161.
  • Strawson, P. F. “Truth,” in Analysis, 9, (1949).
  • Tarski, Alfred. “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages,” in Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics, pp. 152-278, Clarendon Press, 1956.
  • Tarski, Alfred. “The Semantic Conception of Truth and the Foundations of Semantics,” in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, Vol. 4, No. 3 (1944), 341-376.
  • Van Fraassen, Bas. “Truth and Paradoxical Consequences,” in (Martin 1970).
  • Woodruff, Peter. “Paradox, Truth and Logic Part 1: Paradox and Truth,” Journal of Philosophical Logic, 13 (1984), 213-231.
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig. Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, Basil Blackwell, 3rd edition, 1978.
  • Yablo, Stephen. (1993). “Paradox without Self-Reference.” Analysis 53: 251-52.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University, Sacramento
U. S. A.

Divine Simplicity

Divine simplicity is central to the classical Western concept of God. Simplicity denies any physical or metaphysical composition in the divine being. This means God is the divine nature itself and has no accidents (properties that are not necessary) accruing to his nature. There are no real divisions or distinctions in this nature. Thus, the entirety of God is whatever is attributed to him.  Divine simplicity is the hallmark of God’s utter transcendence of all else, ensuring the divine nature to be beyond the reach of ordinary categories and distinctions, or at least their ordinary application. Simplicity in this way confers a unique ontological status that many philosophers find highly peculiar.

Inspired by Greek philosophy, the doctrine exercised a formative influence on the development of Western philosophy and theology. Its presence reverberates throughout an e