Category Archives: Metaphysics & Epistemology

Phenomenological Reduction, The

The Phenomenological Reduction

There is an experience in which it is possible for us to come to the world with no knowledge or preconceptions in hand; it is the experience of astonishment. The “knowing” we have in this experience stands in stark contrast to the “knowing” we have in our everyday lives, where we come to the world with theory and “knowledge” in hand, our minds already made up before we ever engage the world. However, in the experience of astonishment, our everyday “knowing,” when compared to the “knowing” that we experience in astonishment, is shown up as a pale epistemological imposter and is reduced to mere opinion by comparison.

The phenomenological reduction is at once a description and prescription of a technique that allows one to voluntarily sustain the awakening force of astonishment so that conceptual cognition can be carried throughout intentional analysis, thus bringing the “knowing” of astonishment into our everyday experience. It is by virtue of the “knowing” perspective generated by the proper performance of the phenomenological reduction that phenomenology claims to offer such a radical standpoint on the world phenomenon; indeed, it claims to offer a perspective that is so radical, it becomes the standard of rigor whereby every other perspective is judged and by which they are grounded. In what follows there will be close attention paid to correctly understanding the rigorous nature of the phenomenological reduction, the epistemological problem that spawned it, how that problem is solved by the phenomenological reduction, and the truly radical nature of the technique itself.

In other words, the phenomenological reduction is properly understood as a regimen designed to transform a philosopher into a phenomenologist by virtue of the attainment of a certain perspective on the world phenomenon. The path to the attainment of this perspective is a species of meditation, requiring rigorous, persistent effort and is no mere mental exercise. It is a species of meditation because, unlike ordinary meditation, which involves only the mind, this more radical form requires the participation of the entire individual and initially brings about a radical transformation of the individual performing it similar to a religious conversion. Husserl discovered the need for such a regimen once it became clear to him that the foundation upon which scientific inquiry rested was compromised by the very framework of science itself and the psychological assumptions of the scientist; the phenomenological reduction is the technique whereby the phenomenologist puts him or herself in a position to provide adequately rigorous grounds for scientific or any other kind of inquiry.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Historical Background of the Phenomenological Reduction
    1. Husserl’s Early Works
    2. Husserl’s Later Works
  3. The Epistemological Problem the Phenomenological Reduction Aims to Solve
  4. The Analysis That Disclosed the Need for the Reduction
    1. The Self-Refutation of the Sciences
    2. The Reduction Prefigured
  5. The Structure, Nature and Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction
    1. The Structure of the Phenomenological Reduction
      1. The Two Moments of the Phenomenological Reduction
        1. The Epoché
        2. The Reduction Proper
    2. The Nature of the Phenomenological Reduction
      1. Self-Meditation Radicalized
      2. Radical, Rigorous, and Transformative
    3. The Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction
      1. Self-Meditation
  6. How the Reduction Solves the Epistemological Problem
    1. The Problem of Constitution
    2. The Reduction and the Theme of Philosophy
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The phenomenological reduction is the meditative practice described by Edmund Husserl, the founder of phenomenology, whereby one, as a phenomenologist, is able to liberate oneself from the captivation in which one is held by all that one accepts as being the case. According to Husserl, once one is liberated from this captivation-in-an-acceptedness, one is able to view the world as a world of essences, free from any contamination that presuppositions of conceptual framework or psyche might contribute. Many have variously misunderstood the practice of the phenomenological reduction, not in the sense that what they are doing is wrong, but in the sense that they do not take what they do far enough; this article will acquaint the reader with the extent to which Husserl and Fink’s original account intended the performance of the reduction to be taken.

The procedure of the phenomenological reduction emerges in Husserl’s thought as a necessary requirement of the solution he proposed to a problem that he, himself, had raised with respect to the adequacy of the foundation upon which scientific inquiry rests. Thus, if we are ever to achieve an appropriate level of appreciation for the procedure of the phenomenological reduction, we must begin by acquainting ourselves with the role that Husserl sees it playing in his overall project of giving the sciences an adequate epistemological foundation. This problem of the foundation of scientific inquiry spans Husserl’s entire career from his early to later work; we see its beginning arguments in Logical Investigations, one of his earlier works, and we also see it playing a prominent role later in his career as it dominates one of his latest works, The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology. Accordingly, this article will take as themes for its major divisions: 1) the historical background of the phenomenological reduction, 2) Husserl’s analysis of the foundation of scientific inquiry that demonstrates a need for the phenomenological reduction, and 3) The Structure, Nature, and Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction.

The section on the historical background of the phenomenological reduction will serve to show that this procedure does not arrive as “a bolt out of the blue,” as it were; rather, it appears as the logically required solution to a specific problem. The problem that it addresses is the problem of the adequacy of the foundations of scientific inquiry. To illustrate Husserl’s misgivings with the foundations of scientific inquiry, consider the logical relationship between the axioms of geometry and its theorems and proofs. The point of doing proofs in geometry is to show that each theorem of geometry is adequately grounded in the axioms, that which is taken as being “given” in geometry. In scientific inquiry, what scientists take as being given is the natural world and the things in that world; consequently, those things and the world itself are never questioned but taken to be the logical bedrock upon which the subsequent scientific investigations are based. In other words, scientists take the world to be their axioms; and it is this axiomatic status that Husserl throws into question when he shows that the results of scientific investigation are a function of both the architectonics of scientific hypotheses and the psychological coloring of the investigating scientist. For this reason, Husserl says that if we are ever to be able to access the pure world so that it can act as a proper foundation, we must strip away both of these qualifications and return to the “things themselves” [die Sache selbst]. That is, we must return to the world as it is before it is contaminated by either the categories of scientific inquiry or the psychological assumptions of the scientist. The phenomenological reduction is the technique whereby this stripping away occurs; and the technique itself has two moments: the first Husserl names epoché, using the Greek term for abstention, and the second is referred to as the reduction proper, an inquiring back into consciousness.

2. Historical Background of the Phenomenological Reduction

a. Husserl’s Early Works

Since the main burden of this article lies in the specific area of the phenomenological reduction, it is not necessary to go into great detail regarding Husserl’s early work beyond noting that it dealt almost exclusively with mathematics and logic; and that it is the ground out of which his later thought grew. In his Philosophy of Arithmetic (1891), Husserl questions the psychological origin of basic arithmetical concepts such as unity, multiplicity, and number; a project that he pursues later into the Prolegomena to the Logical Investigations. In the former work, Husserl gives us an analysis of the origin of the authentic concept of number, i.e., number to be conceived intuitionally. It is here that Husserl pays special attention to the question of the foundation of abstraction for the basic arithmetical concepts. Thus, we find that Husserl’s early efforts at providing a subjective complement to objective logic led him to investigate the general a priori of correlation of cognition, of the sense of cognition and the object of cognition, and led him also to conceive an absolute science designed as a universal analysis of constitution in which the origins of objectivity in transcendental subjectivity are elucidated.

A crucial element of Husserl’s early work in the Philosophy of Arithmetic is his critique of psychologism; it is this critique that is continued in his Logical Investigations and which sets the stage for the emancipation of the formal-logical objects and laws from psychological determinations, as was the then-current view. However, this liberation was not Husserl’s ultimate goal, but merely the preparatory work for understanding the connection between pure logic and concrete (psychical, or rather phenomenological) processes of thinking, between ideal conditions of cognition and temporally individuated acts of thinking.

b. Husserl’s Later Works

It is owing to this goal that Husserl’s later work moves quickly away from the strictly logical and mathematical character of his early work and takes on the more transcendental character of his later work. Thus, the trend of Husserl’s thought moves from his critique of the psychologistic account of mathematical and logical objects to transcendental subjectivity by means of his persistent questioning of the foundation of knowledge. It is important to note that his questioning of the foundation of knowledge is not the same as the quest for certainty that characterizes much of modernist thought—to which some philosophers believe Husserl’s American contemporary, John Dewey in his The Quest for Certainty, presented successful objections. Rather, Husserl’s quest was not for certainty but for the founding of the conditions for the possibility of knowledge. That is, he was not searching for an answer to the question: How do we know the tree is in the quad? He was seeking an answer to the question: How does it come about that consciousness can make contact with the tree in the quad? This is what was meant above when mention was made that Husserl’s ultimate goal was to understand the connection between pure logic and concrete processes of thinking.

In his dogged pursuit of an answer to this question, Husserl is pushed from the then current psychological theory to the object; from the object back to consciousness, and finally all the way back to transcendental consciousness and the emergence of the “ultimate question of phenomenology” regarding the phenomenology of phenomenology. It is this question of the phenomenology of phenomenology that dominates the inquiry into the nature of the phenomenological reduction that we find in Sixth Cartesian Meditation and in the articles that Eugen Fink wrote around 1933 and 1934 in his attempt to further explain the phenomenological philosophy of Edmund Husserl. However, what we need is a more finely tuned elucidation of the epistemological problem that was the initial impetus driving Husserl’s early efforts.

3. The Epistemological Problem the Phenomenological Reduction Aims to Solve

The prevailing epistemology in Husserl’s time was a neo-Kantian position; indeed, it was owing to the criticism brought against phenomenology by this cadre of philosophers that Eugen Fink was constrained to publish his very important article, “The Phenomenological Philosophy of Edmund Husserl and Contemporary Criticism” in the journal, Kant-Studien; Fink uses the locution “contemporary criticism” in his title as a euphemism for “neo-Kantians.” Roughly put, the Kantian epistemological model is one that strives to ameliorate the stark contrast between the position Descartes put forward and the one brought about by the criticism of his position in the writings of Locke, Berkeley, and Hume, to name a few; that is, Kant’s position is one that seeks an irenic modulation between the rationalists and the empiricists. Kant’s epistemology, however conciliatory toward each camp, still leaned heavily on certain aspects of Descartes’ thought; notably, the distinction between consciousness and object (mind and body), albeit in Kant’s terms this distinction was taken up as a distinction between a noumenal world and a phenomenal world—a difference that Kant bridged by means of the categories. The categories themselves were arrived at by asking the question: what would have to be the case in order for our experience of the world to be as it is? This question is commonly referred to as the question determining the conditions for the possibility of experience and more specifically as the Transcendental Deduction.

Husserl’s epistemological insight is that there is no such distinction between consciousness and object, as had been assumed by Descartes and subsequently taken up in a slightly different form by Kant. In Husserl’s thought, the terms “noesis” and “noema” do not so much identify distinct items set over against each other (e.g. consciousness and object) as much as they provide a linguistic vehicle to speak about the interpenetration of each by the other as aspects of a more inclusive whole, the Life-world—understood in its broadest sense. A key point made by Fink in his article for the neo-Kantians is that when we think of the world, it is always a world already containing us thinking it; this fact is overlooked by the Kantian picture of the world; a picture which assumes a perspective that is neither consciousness nor world but which sets each over against the other. For Kant, this imagined perspective is what gives us access to the distinction between the noumenal and phenomenal worlds; ironically, it is also this perspective that makes the transcendental deduction necessary, since the distinction between noumenal and phenomenal is a state of affairs to which we do not have direct access and must, of necessity, deduce it.

Husserl constructs his epistemological position by first noticing the very obvious fact that all consciousness is consciousness of something; and it is this insight that establishes the relationship between the noesis and noema. If knowledge is ever to be established at all, it must be established in consciousness; the epistemological problem, then, for Husserl is to describe consciousness, since without consciousness, no knowledge is possible. Or, to put a more Kantian spin on it, consciousness itself is the condition for the possibility of knowledge. Furthermore, since we are always already in a world, the first task of epistemology is to properly and accurately describe what is already the case; and we can do this only if we begin with a thorough examination of consciousness itself and carry that examination all the way back to the “I” in the “I Am.” Husserl speaks of going “back” [ruckfrage] because we must begin where we are; and where we are includes a sense of self whose identity is temporarily seated in the sedimented layers of consciousness built up through our temporal experiences. Hence, if we are to encounter the “I” we must dig back down through those layers or we must continually present ourselves with the question: who is “I”? as we consider the great variety of things with which we have identified. This questioning back is the method of the phenomenological reduction and aims to lay bare the “I”—the condition for the possibility of knowledge.

It is important to keep in mind that Husserl’s phenomenology did not arise out of the questioning of an assumption in the same way that much of the history of thought has progressed; rather, it was developed, as so many discoveries are, pursuant to a particular experience, namely, the experience of the world and self that one has if one determinedly seeks to experience the “I”; and, Hume notwithstanding, such an experience is possible.

4. The Analysis That Disclosed the Need for the Reduction

Although it is generally conceded that Husserl’s thought underwent a significant transformation from his early interests in logic and mathematics, as indicated in his “On the Concept of Number” and his Philosophy of Arithmetic, to his later transcendental interests, as indicated by The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology, the actual “turning point” is not so generally accepted. This is due, in part, to the fact that Husserl’s work can be viewed developmentally both according to the chronological appearance of his work and according to its systematic connections. Thus, the “development” of his thought can be seen either in terms of his published work, i.e., chronologically, or in terms of key systematic methodological concepts. Viewed chronologically, Bernet, Kern, and Marbach (Bernet, 1989) put the beginning of the split around 1915-1917, the last years Husserl spent at Göttingen, but is only clearly seen in the early years of Husserl’s teaching at Freiburg (around 1917-1921) (p.1); but considered systematically, they say that the partition relates to the consistent extension of the research program of phenomenological philosophy towards a genetic-explanatory phenomenology as a supplement to the hitherto carried-out static-descriptive phenomenology (p.1). The terms “static,” “genetic,” and “generative” phenomenology refer to aspects of phenomenology that come into play after the reduction has been performed; however, they articulate distinctions that must be kept clearly in mind when evaluating phenomenological analyses.

In the early phases of his thinking, Husserl was concerned chiefly with the phenomenological-descriptive analysis of specific types of experiences and their correlates as well as with describing general structures of consciousness; he also aimed at the foundation and elaboration of the corresponding methodology (phenomenological reflection, reduction, and eidetics) (p.1). Similarly in the later phases of his thought, there is the attempt by means of genetic phenomenology to elucidate the concrete unification of experiencing in the personal ego and in the transcendental community of egos, or monads, as well as in the constitution of the correlative surrounding worlds and of the one world common to all (p.2).

For the purposes of tracing the development of the phenomenological reduction, I take the relevant period of the transformation of Husserl’s thought from early to late to be between 1900 and 1913; the two volumes of Logical Investigations were published in 1900 and 1901 but it wasn’t until the appearance of The Idea of Phenomenology in 1907 that many of the characteristic themes of phenomenology were explicitly articulated. This little volume was soon followed by the publication of “Philosophy as Rigorous Science” in 1911; and that by the publication of Ideas I in 1913, where the most explicit treatment, up to that time, of the main phenomenological themes is given.

a. The Self-Refutation of the Sciences

In order to grasp the full import of the move that Husserl makes to phenomenology, we must understand the arguments that motivate that move; and we get a glimpse of those arguments in his “Philosophy as Rigorous Science” published in 1911. In that article, Husserl’s chief aim is epistemological and expresses itself first as a critique of the natural sciences and psychology and then as an adumbration of a technique that later, in 1913 with the publication of Ideen I, would be termed the “epoché ” or the “reduction.”

Husserl begins his critique of the natural sciences by noting certain absurdities that become evident when such naturalism is adopted in an effort to “naturalize” consciousness and reason; these absurdities are both theoretical and practical. Husserl says that when “the formal-logical principles, the so-called ‘laws of thought,’ are interpreted by naturalism as natural laws of thinking,” there occurs a kind of “inevitable” absurdity owing to an inherent inconsistency involved in the naturalist position. His claim in this article alludes to the more fully formed argument from volume 1 of his Logical Investigations (Husserl, 1970), which will be summarized here.

The natural sciences are empirical sciences and, as such, deal only with empirical facts. Thus, when the formal-logical principles are subsumed under the “laws of Nature” as “laws of thought,” this makes the “law of thought” just one among many of the empirical laws of nature. However, Husserl notes that “the only way in which a natural law can be established and justified, is by induction from the singular facts of experience” (p.99). Furthermore, induction does not establish the holding of the law, “only the greater or lesser probability of its holding; the probability, and not the law, is justified by insight” (p.99). This means that logical laws must, without exception, rank as mere probabilities; yet, as he then notes, “nothing, however, seems plainer than that the laws of ‘pure logic’ all have a priori validity” (p.99). That is to say, the laws of ‘pure logic’ are established and justified, not by induction, but by apodictic inner evidence; insight justifies their truth itself. Thus, as Husserl remarks in “Philosophy as a Rigorous Science” (1965) that “naturalism refutes itself” (p.80). It is this theoretical absurdity that leads to a similar absurdity in practice.

The absurdity in practice, says Husserl, becomes apparent when we notice that the naturalist is “dominated by the purpose of making scientifically known whatever is genuine truth, the genuinely beautiful and good; he wants to know how to determine what is its universal essence and the method by which it is to be obtained in the particular case” (pp.80-81). Thus, the naturalist believes that through natural science and through a philosophy based on the same science the goal has been attained; but, says Husserl, the naturalist is going on presuppositions; indeed, to the extent that he theorizes at all, it is just to that extent “that he objectively sets up values to which value judgments are to correspond, and likewise in setting up any practical rules according to which each one is to be guided in his willing and in his conduct” (p.81). It is this state of affairs that drives Husserl to the observation that the naturalist is “idealist and objectivist in the way he acts”; since both of these cannot be true at the same time, the naturalist is involved in an absurdity (p.80).

Husserl claims that the natural scientist is not outwardly aware of these absurdities owing to the fact that he “naturalizes reason” and, on this account, is blinded by prejudice. He adds, “One who sees only empirical science will not be particularly disturbed by absurd consequences that cannot be proved empirically to contradict facts of nature” (pp.81-82). This is not to say that Husserl is arguing against science as such, to the contrary, he says that there is “in all modern life no more powerfully, more irresistibly progressing idea than that of science” and that “with regard to its legitimate aims, it is all-embracing. Looked upon in its ideal perfection, it would be reason itself, which could have no other authority equal or superior to itself” (p.82). The problem is that naturalism, which wanted to establish philosophy both on a basis of strict science and as a strict science, appears completely discredited along with its method. To this point in the argument, Husserl has simply shown that the foundation upon which scientific inquiry rests is self-contradictory and fails to offer adequate grounding. So, if the natural scientist cannot provide us with a “rigorous science” then what is needed and to whom can we look?

b. The Reduction Prefigured

Husserl’s idea is that the problems belonging to the domain of a “strict science,” namely, theoretical, axiological, and practical problems, give us a clue themselves as to the method required for their solution. He says, “through a clarification of the problems and through penetration into their pure sense, the methods adequate to these problems, because demanded by their very essence, must impose themselves on us” (p.83). It is for this reason that the refutation of naturalism based on its consequences that he just finished accomplishes very little for him, what is important is the principiant critique of the foundations of naturalism; and by this he means that he wants to direct a critical analysis at the philosophy that believes “it has definitely attained the rank of an exact science” (p.84). So what Husserl will be putting to the test is the relative strength of the term “exact” when it is used in this context. It is not the case that Husserl thinks that a science of nature does not produce important results; he thinks it does. The problem, as Husserl sees it, is that a science of nature is inadequate if it is not ultimately grounded in a strictly scientific philosophy. Husserl is not criticizing the results of science (the structural design and dignity of the house that science built) but only the foundation upon which those results rest.

With respect to the foundation, Husserl says that all natural science is naïve in regard to its point of departure because the nature that it investigates “is for it simply there.” In other words, the things that natural science investigates are its foundation because they mark the point of departure for natural science. These things are simply taken for granted uncritically as being there and “it is the aim of natural science to know these unquestioned data in an objectively valid, strictly scientific manner” (p.85). The same holds true for psychology in its domain of consciousness. It is the task of psychology “to explore this psychic element scientifically within the psychophysical nexus of nature, to determine it in an objectively valid way, to discover the laws according to which it develops and changes, comes into being and disappears” (p.86). Even where psychology, as an empirical science, concerns itself with determinations of bare events of consciousness and not with dependencies that are psychophysical, “those events are thought of, nevertheless, as belonging to nature, that is, as belonging to human or brute consciousnesses that for their part have an unquestioned and co-apprehended connection with human and brute organisms” (p.86). Thus, he states that “every psychological judgment involves the existential positing of physical nature, whether expressly or not” (p.86).

This uncritical acceptance is also reflected in the naïveté that characterizes natural science since at every place in its procedure it accepts nature as given and relies upon it when it performs experiments. Thus, ultimately, every method of experiential science leads back precisely to experience. But isolated experience is of no worth to science; rather, “it is in the methodical disposition and connection of experiences, in the interplay of experience and thought which has its rigid logical laws, that valid experience is distinguished from invalid, that each experience is accorded its level of validity, and that objectively valid knowledge as such, knowledge of nature, is worked out” (p.87). Although this critique of experience is satisfactory, says Husserl, as long as we remain within natural science and think according to its point of view, a completely different critique of experience is still possible and indispensable. It is a critique that places in question all experience as such as well as the sort of thinking proper to empirical science (p.87).

For Husserl, this is a critique that raises questions such as: “how can experience as consciousness give or contact an object? How can experiences be mutually legitimated or corrected by means of each other, and not merely replace each other or confirm each other subjectively? How can the play of a consciousness whose logic is empirical make objectively valid statements, valid for things that are in and for themselves? Why are the playing rules, so to speak, of consciousness not irrelevant for things?” It is by means of these questions that Husserl hopes to highlight his major concern of how it is that natural science can be comprehensible in every case, “to the extent that it pretends at every step to posit and to know a nature that is in itself—in itself in opposition to the subjective flow of consciousness” (p.88). He says that these questions become riddles as soon as reflection upon them becomes serious and that epistemology has been the traditional discipline to which these questions were referred, but epistemology has not answered the call in a manner “scientifically clear, unanimous, and decisive.”

To Husserl, this all points to the absurdity of a theory of knowledge that is based on any psychological theory of knowledge. He punctuates this claim by noting that if certain riddles are inherent, in principle, to natural science, then “it is self-evident that the solution of these riddles according to premises and conclusions in principle transcends natural science.” He adds that “to expect from natural science itself the solution of any one of the problems inherent in it as such—thus inhering through and through, from beginning to end—or even merely to suppose that it could contribute to the solution of such a problem any premises whatsoever, is to be involved in a vicious circle” (pp.88-89).

With this being the case, it becomes clear to Husserl that every scientific, as well as every pre-scientific, application of nature “must in principle remain excluded in a theory of knowledge that is to retain its univocal sense. So, too, must all expressions that imply thetic existential positings of things in the framework of space, time, causality, etc. This obviously applies also to all existential positings with regard to the empirical being of the investigator, of his psychical faculties, and the like” (p.89). It is here, in this passage, that we see the formal beginnings of what will later be termed the “epoché ” and “reduction” in Ideen I.

Husserl is advocating a theory of knowledge that will investigate the problems of the relationship between consciousness and being in a way that excludes, not only the “thetic existential positings of things in the framework of space, time, causality, etc.,” but also the “existential positings” and “psychical faculties” of the investigator. In other words, he wants to separate the subject matter he is investigating from both the theoretical framework of science and the coloring with which any investigator might qualify it. But to do so, knowledge theory can have before its eyes “only being as the correlate of consciousness: as perceived, remembered, expected, represented pictorially, imagined, identified, distinguished, believed, opined, evaluated, etc.” And for Husserl, this means that the investigation must be directed “toward a scientific essential knowledge of consciousness, toward that which consciousness itself ‘is’ according to its essence in all its distinguishable forms” (p.89). Husserl also notes that the investigation must also be directed toward “what consciousness ‘means,’ as well as toward the different ways in which—in accord with the essence of the aforementioned forms—it intends the objective, now clearly, now obscurely, now by presenting or by presentifying, now symbolically or pictorially, now simply, now mediated in thought, now in this or that mode of attention, and so in countless other forms, and how ultimately it ‘demonstrates’ the objective as that which is ‘validly,’ ‘really’” (p.89).

To summarize, what Husserl wants to do is to provide an unshakable ground for science, so as to make it “rigorous” and “exact.” He dismisses the efforts of both science and psychology to provide such a ground owing to the fact that the “riddles” inherent in each necessarily put the solution outside of their reach. He also notes that the traditional discipline of epistemology has failed to do this and suggests that what is needed is an investigation that is directed toward “a scientific essential knowledge of consciousness, toward that which consciousness itself ‘is’ according to its essence in all its distinguishable forms.” Furthermore, this can only be done if we separate the matter in question from the qualifications imposed on it by either the theoretical framework of science or the existential “positings” of the investigator. In other words, we must return to the matters in question, as they are themselves; and the procedure whereby this is accomplished is phenomenology, specifically, the phenomenological reduction.

5. The Structure, Nature and Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction

a. The Structure of the Phenomenological Reduction

i. The Two Moments of the Phenomenological Reduction

What actually occurs when one undertakes to perform the reduction can be discerned by giving careful attention to the things Husserl and Fink have said about it; but let me first address some terminological concerns regarding two key concepts. In Sixth Cartesian Meditation (Fink, 1995), Fink tells us “epoché and the action of the reduction proper are the two internal basic moments of the phenomenological reduction, mutually required and mutually conditioned” (p.41). This passage alerts us to the fact that the locution, phenomenological reduction, denotes two separate “moments,” each of which requires and conditions the other. Thus, in speaking of “the reduction” one needs to be careful to specify whether it is the reduction proper, which is only one of the two moments, that is meant, or whether one means the entire operation of the phenomenological reduction.

Let me also draw attention to the term “moments” here because, in order to get an accurate conception and understanding of the phenomenological reduction, we must see that it is not done in two “steps.” The moments are internal logical moments and do not refer to two “steps” that one might take to conclude the procedure as one might do, for example, in waxing a floor: where the first step is to strip off the old wax and the second step is to apply the new wax; steps imply a temporal individuation that is not true of the moments of the phenomenological reduction. Husserl’s term, epoché, the negative move whereby we bracket the world, is not a “step” that we do “first” in an effort to prepare ourselves for the later “step,” reduction proper; rather, the bracketing and the move whereby we drive the self back upon itself, the reduction proper, occur together.

There were many during his day who misunderstood what Husserl and Fink were trying to communicate; and I think part of what might have contributed to this misunderstanding is that Husserl’s readers thought that the reduction was a “two-step” process conducted wholly within the realm of the mind or imagination, not requiring any other kind of bodily participation.

1) The Epoché

Husserl’s insight is that we live our lives in what he terms a “captivation-in-an-acceptedness;” that is to say, we live our lives in an unquestioning sort of way by being wholly taken up in the unbroken belief-performance of our customary life in the world. We take for granted our bodies, the culture, gravity, our everyday language, logic and a myriad other facets of our existence. All of this together is present to every individual in every moment and makes up what Fink terms “human immanence”; everyone accepts it and this acceptance is what keeps us in captivity. The epoché is a procedure whereby we no longer accept it. Hence, Fink notes in Sixth Cartesian Meditation: “This self consciousness develops in that the onlooker that comes to himself in the epoché reduces ‘bracketed’ human immanence by explicit inquiry back behind the acceptednesses in self-apperception that hold regarding humanness, that is, regarding one’s belonging to the world; and thus he lays bare transcendental experiential life and the transcendental having of the world” (p.40). Husserl has referred to this variously as “bracketing” or “putting out of action” but it boils down to the same thing, we must somehow come to see ourselves as no longer of this world, where “this world” means to capture all that we currently accept.

At this point it may prove prudent to head off some possible misunderstandings with respect to the epoché. Perhaps the most frequent error made with respect to the epoché is made in regards to its role in the abstention of belief in the world. Here it is important to realize two things: the first is that withdrawal of belief in the world is not a denial of the world. It should not be considered that the abstention of belief in the world’s existence is the same as the denial of its existence; indeed, the whole point of the epoché is that it is neither an affirmation nor a denial in the existence of the world. In fact, says Fink, “the misunderstanding that takes the phenomenological epoché to be a straightforwardly thematic abstention from belief (instead of understanding it as transcendentally reflective!) not only has the consequence that we believe we have to fear the loss of the thematic field, but is also intimately connected with a misunderstanding of the reductive return to constituting consciousness” (p.43). The second thing has to do with who it is that is doing the abstaining and this directly concerns the moment of the reduction proper.

2) The Reduction Proper

The second moment of the phenomenological reduction is what Fink terms the “reduction proper;” he says, “under the concept of ‘action of reduction proper’ we can understand all the transcendental insights in which we blast open captivation-in-an-acceptedness and first recognize the acceptedness as an acceptedness in the first place” (p.41). If the epoché is the name for whatever method we use to free ourselves from the captivity of the unquestioned acceptance of the everyday world, then the reduction is the recognition of that acceptance as an acceptance. Fink adds, “abstention from belief can only be radical and universal when that which falls under disconnection by the epoché comes to be clearly seen precisely as a belief-construct, as an acceptedness.” It is the seeing of the acceptance as an acceptance that is the indication of having achieved a transcendental insight; it is transcendental precisely because it is an insight from outside the acceptedness that is holding us captive. It should be kept in mind that the “seeing” to which Fink refers is not a “knowing that” we live in captivation-in-an-acceptedness, since this can be achieved in the here and now by simply believing that Fink is telling the truth; the kind of “seeing” to which Fink refers is rather more like the kind of seeing that occurs when one discovers that the mud on the carpet was put there by oneself and not by another, as was first suspected.

Thus, as Fink points out, it is through the reductive insight into the transcendental being-sense of the world as “acceptedness” that “the radicality of the phenomenological epoché first becomes possible;” but “on the other hand, the reduction consistently performed and maintained, first gives methodic certainty to the reductive regress” (p.41). Taken together, the epoché and the reduction proper comprise the technique referred to as the phenomenological reduction; since these two moments cannot occur independently, it is easy to see how the single term, “reduction,” can come to be the term of preference to denote the whole of the phenomenological reduction.

Fink also brings out a misunderstanding relating to the reduction proper, which is that it is taken as a species of speculation: “hand in hand with this misunderstanding of the epoché goes a falsification of the sense of the action of reduction proper (the move back behind the self-objectivation of transcendental subjectivity). The latter is rejected as speculative construction, for instance when one says: in actuality the phenomenologist has no other theme than human inwardness” (p.47). To think that there is such reinterpretation or speculation is to miss the point of the reduction proper, that is, it is to miss the fact that what it does is interrogate man and the world and makes them the theme of a transcendental clarification—it is precisely the world phenomenon, or “being”, which is bracketed.

According to Fink and Husserl, the phenomenological reduction consists in these two “moments” of epoché and reduction proper; epoché is the “moment” in which we abandon the acceptedness of the world that holds us captive and the reduction proper indicates the “moment” in which we come to the transcendental insight that the acceptedness of the world is an acceptedness and not an absolute. The structure of the phenomenological reduction has belonging to it the human I standing in the natural attitude, the transcendental constituting I, and the transcendental phenomenologizing I, also called the onlooker or spectator. Fink says that “the reducing I is the phenomenological onlooker. This means he is, first, the one practicing the epoché and then the one who reduces, in the strict sense” (p.39).

Thus, it is by means of the epoché and reduction proper that the human I becomes distinguished from the constituting I; it is by abandoning our acceptance of the world that we are enabled to see it as captivating and hold it as a theme. It is from this perspective that the phenomenologist is able to see the world without the framework of science or the psychological assumptions of the individual.

b. The Nature of the Phenomenological Reduction

The phenomenological reduction is a radical, rigorous, and transformative meditative technique. To illustrate this, let me turn to comments that Fink makes in his “What Does the Phenomenology of Edmund Husserl Want to Accomplish: The Phenomenological Idea of Laying a Ground” (Fink, 1966/1972; German/English).

i. Self-Meditation Radicalized

The most important point to be made in reference to the nature of the phenomenological reduction is that it is a meditative technique and not a mere mental or imaginative technique. Furthermore, it is a self-meditation that has been radicalized. Fink introduces this in his discussion of laying a ground. He says that “the laying-of-a-ground of a philosophy is the original beginning of the philosopher himself, not with and for others but for himself alone; it is the disclosing of the ground which is capable of bearing the totality of a philosophical interpretation of the world” (p.161/11). In this passage we can plainly see that the ground of which Fink is speaking is not considered to be propositions, ideas, or anything else of that sort; rather the ground is precisely the philosopher him or herself. Thus, Fink says, “it is a fateful error to suppose that the principles, in accordance with which a ground-laying of philosophy is to proceed, would be present—transported, as it were, from the conflict of philosophers—as a normative ideal prior to and outside of philosophy” (p.161/11). Hence, regardless of “how such a ground-laying is carried out—be it as a return to the concealed, a priori law-giving of reason, or be it as a progression towards essentials, and the like—the meditation [die Besinnung], in which such a ground-laying is carried out, is always the first, fundamental decision of a philosophizing” (p.161/11).

Unless the term “meditation,” as Fink uses it in this context, springs out at one when reading it, the heart of this passage is likely to be misunderstood. Here there is a clear connection being established between some meditative practice [Besinnung] and the laying of a ground for philosophy. It is important to draw attention to this feature since we typically think of axioms or assumptions when we assay to discern the foundation of a philosophy; but Fink is making a clear break with that practice, holding instead that the first, fundamental decision of a philosophizing is “the meditation, in which a ground-laying is carried out” [“immer ist die Besinnung, in der sich eine solche Grundlegung vollzieht, die erste grundsätzliche Entscheidung eines Philosophierens.”] (p.162/11).

Fink adds to this by noting that “the commencement of the idea of laying-a-ground, which determines a philosophy, is always already the implicit (and perhaps only obscurely conscious) fore-grasp upon the system. Thus in embryonic form, the idea of the system is sketched out in the idea of laying-a-ground” (p.162/11). In other words, the idea of the ground-laying works itself out in whatever philosophy it grounds; the philosophy is itself pre-figured in the ground-laying and reflects it.

He explains this pre-figuring further by saying that, in the case of the philosophy of Husserl, the idea of the ground-laying working itself out “can, at first, be made understandable from the pathos of phenomenology, that is, from the deportment of the human existence lying at its ground” (p.162/11). Fink allows that this pathos is “in no way a specifically ‘phenomenological’ one, but is, rather, the constant pathos of every philosophy which, when taken seriously in a particular, inexorable way, must lead to phenomenology itself” (p.162/11). Indeed, this pathos is “nothing other than the world-wide storm of the passion of thinking which, extending out into the totality of entities and grasping it, subjects it to the spirit” (p.163/11). Fink is saying here that the will, as the pathos of philosophy, is “resolved to understand the world out of the spirit [die Welt aus dem Geist zu verstehen],” which does not mean the “naïve belief in a pre-given and present-at-hand ‘spiritual sense’ of the world, but solely the willingness to bring the spirit first to its realization precisely through the knowledge of the All of entities” (p.163/12).

Although this passage would seem to indicate the crassest “intellectualism,” since it seems to be saying that knowledge is the main operative process, Fink is insistent that neither the “‘rationalistically’ claimed self-certainty of the spirit” (here read Descartes), nor “the fascination with chaos” (read Nietzsche) that “all too easily is transformed into a defeatism of reason,” captures what he means. Rather, he says, “precisely in the face of chaos, standing fast against it, the philosopher ventures the spiritual conquering of the entity; he raises the claim of a radical and universal knowledge of the world” (p.164/12). If we inquire as to how it is possible that spirit can maintain itself and its claim, or whether it has itself already become a “ground experience”; whether we “Know what authentically is ‘spirit’” or what the true power of philosophizing existence is, Fink tells us: “Understanding itself in the passion of thinking, the pathos of the one who is philosophizing is cast back upon itself: it radicalizes itself into self-meditation [Selbstbesinnung], as into the way in which the spirit [der Geist] experiences itself. The phenomenological philosophy of Husserl lives in the pathos of that self-realization of the spirit [der Geist] which takes place in self-meditation” (p.164/13). Indeed, “the idea of the ground-laying of philosophy peculiar to phenomenology is the idea of the pure and persistent self meditation [der reinen und konsequenten Selbstbesinnung]” (p.164/13).

Although, as Fink notes, in the subjective mode of self-meditation, every philosophy carries out the business of laying a ground; “phenomenology is also materially grounded exclusively on self-meditation [gründet auch sachlich ausschließlich auf Selbstbesinnung]” (p.164/13). What Fink means here by using the term “exclusively” is that “from the very beginning phenomenology foregoes ever abandoning the deportment of pure self-meditation in favor of an objective deportment. It wants to be grounded solely upon the results of a radical and persistent self-meditation and to establish upon them the entirety of its philosophical system” (p. 164/13). Hence, for phenomenology, self-meditation is not a “mere subjective method for disclosing, as the ground and basis of the philosophical interpretation of the world, an objectivity sketched out in our spirit, for example, the objective essence of reason; rather it re-delineates the sole fundamental realm in which the philosophical problem of the world can arise” (p.164/13). Thus, in phenomenology “the concept of ‘ground,’ in return to which the philosophical grasping of the world realizes itself, has lost its usual ‘objective’ sense precisely through the persistent adherence to self-meditation, carried out with a certain radicalism of ‘purity,’ as the exclusive thematic source of philosophy” (p.165/13). Fink adds: “The ground, posited in the phenomenological idea of laying-a-ground, is the ‘self’ which uncovers itself only in pure self-meditation” (p.165/13-14).

The general logical form of this argument will reappear in 1954 with the publishing of The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology. There the argument is made that the sciences not only take the everyday life-world for granted, the everyday life-world is actually the ground for all that the sciences do because it is from there that they take their starting point. In a similar move of reasoning, the argument in this article is aimed at drawing attention to the obvious fact that the philosopher is always the real ground for any philosophy; and that if we wish, as it were, to ground that ground, we must embark on a procedure of self-meditation—indeed, if rigor is to be maintained, we are required to undertake such a course of action.

Of course, a number of questions immediately surround the suggestion of “self-meditation,” all of which derive from “the naïve and familiar, pre-given concept of ‘self-meditation’”; but it is precisely this concept that must be transformed, says Fink: “the dimension of philosophy can be attained only in the radical change of self-meditation from the indeterminateness of the preliminary, still unclarified concept into the determined phenomenological setting” (p.165/14). Thus, the former questions are now transformed into questions such as: How can this change be accomplished, and what must the nature of self-meditation be, such that, precisely in the thematization of the self, the question of the totality of entities is included and traced out in its fundamental solution? Fink’s response is that to this there is only one answer: “the transformation of the idea of the common self-meditation happens eo ipso in an extremely intensified taking of self-meditation seriously. The seriousness demanded here wants nothing less than to expose the spirit to a ground-experience which will bring it back into the power of the essence that is purely proper to it. In the self-meditation radicalized into the ‘phenomenological reduction,’ the spirit should accomplish a movement towards itself, should come unto itself” (p.165/14). But in what sense is this self-meditation radical?

ii. Radical, Rigorous, and Transformative

Some today have misunderstood the phenomenological reduction and it is probable that this failure to grasp what Husserl has discovered is partly owing to the radical nature of Husserl’s project being completely missed. Fink pieces together the very analysis of the reduction that is wanted here if we are ever to disabuse ourselves of the view that the reduction is nothing more than a mere incantation or formal condition—a mental exercise.

This type of misunderstanding of the nature of phenomenology is not something new; Fink himself made explicit reference to its breadth, even as late as 1934 when this article was originally published, saying: “The contemporary judgment of the phenomenological philosophy of Husserl fails, almost without exception, to recognize its true meaning” (Accomplish, p. 6). He then cites examples, noting that “Husserl is judged, admired and reproached sometimes as an eidetician and logician, at other times as a theoretician of knowledge, on the one hand, as an ontologist giving word to the ‘matters themselves,’ and, on the other hand, as an ‘Idealist.’ Thereby, every such Interpretation is capable, with moderate violence, of ‘proving’ itself from his writings. The authentic and central meaning of Edmund Husserl’s philosophy is today still unknown” (p. 6). Fink attributes this lack of authentic understanding, not to a lack of willingness to understand on the part of the community of readers, but, to the essence of phenomenology itself. So, the important question is: what is it about the essence of phenomenology that makes it so difficult for the devotee to come away with an authentic understanding of it?

According to Fink, we find the answer to this question by considering the fact that the appropriation of the true meaning of phenomenology “cannot at all come about within the horizon of our natural deportment of knowledge. Access to phenomenology demands a radical reversal of our total existence reaching into our depths, a change of every pre-scientifically-immediate comportment to world and things as well as of the disposition of our life lying at the basis of all scientific and traditionally-philosophical attitudes of knowledge” (p. 6).

Nearly everyone, who has had even a casual acquaintance with Husserl’s writings, has read something akin to this passage somewhere, claiming the radicality of what phenomenology attempts. Husserl is continually drawing our attention to the radical nature of phenomenology and how it affects all of our scientific knowledge and understanding; indeed, emphasizing how it grounds that very knowledge and understanding. The important thing to notice in regards to such passages, however, is that the misunderstanding of phenomenology arises precisely because the notions of the term “radical,” which are employed by the would-be readers as a hermeneutical guide in their efforts to come to an authentic appreciation of the practice of phenomenology, fail to capture all that Husserl intends by his use of it—and this in spite of the fact that he, time and again, tells us that his use of the term “radical” is new.

Consider, for instance, Husserl’s introduction to the Cartesian Meditations where he expounds on the need for a “radical new beginning” of philosophy saying, “to renew with greater intensity the radicalness of their spirit, the radicalness of self-responsibility, to make that radicalness true for the first time by enhancing it to the last degree…” (Cartesian Meditations, p. 6). Husserl’s emphatic demand that the radicalness become true “for the first time” indicates that his sense of “radical” is much more radical than might ordinarily be thought. Again, in Sixth Cartesian Meditation we read, “This is the problem of the proper methodological character of the phenomenological fore-knowledge that first makes it possible to pose the radical questions—in a new sense of ‘radical’—, to provide the motive for performing the phenomenological reduction” (Sixth, p. 36). Here we see an explicit mention of the fact that the term “radical” is being employed in a “new” sense.

Thus, when some of misunderstand the reduction, they, most probably, are not taking seriously Husserl’s claim of radicality, i.e., they have not understood exactly how extreme Husserl’s sense of the term is. If they, however, take a close look at Fink’s development and analysis of phenomenology in this article and by pay close attention to the intensity of the language he uses in relation to it, we can remedy this deficiency quite easily; but not without also considering the rigor required to perform the phenomenological reduction.

One important feature of the way Fink sets up his discussion of the ground and his illustration of the rigor required in the performance of the phenomenological reduction is his dramatic use of Plato’s allegory of the cave. He says, “the violence, tension and struggle of the accomplishment of philosophizing symbolized in this allegory also determines the phenomenological philosophy of Edmund Husserl” (Accomplish, p. 160/9). If there is any doubt as to how we should understand the terms “violence” and “struggle,” as he uses them in this context, Fink dispatches it immediately with the following: “The philosophical ‘unchaining,’ the tearing oneself free from the power of one’s naïve submission to the world, the stepping-forth from out of that familiarity with entities which always provides us with security, in one word, the phenomenological ‘epoché,’ is anything but a noncommittal, ‘merely’ theoretical, intellectual act; it is rather a spiritual movement of one’s self encompassing the entire man and, as an attack upon the ‘state-of-motionlessness’ supporting us in our depths, the pain of a fundamental transformation down to our roots” (p. 160-1/9). It should be clear that Fink’s use of terms such as “violence,” “struggle,” “unchaining,” “pain,” and “fundamental transformation” indicate a much more rigorous project than armchair philosophy has been wont to allow up to this point. But what is it that makes it so rigorous; what is it that we do when we perform the phenomenological reduction?

We get a preliminary description of what is required from Fink: “Our era can really attain to Husserl’s philosophy, which down to today is still unknown and ungrasped, only by ascending out of the cave of world-constraint, by passing through the pain of self-releasement—and not through ‘critiques’ that are thoroughly bound to the naïve understanding of the world, enslaved to the natural thought-habits and entangled in the pre-constituted word-meanings of the everyday and scientific language” (p. 161/10). Here, again, we find familiar language; language that might have been encountered in any number of Husserl’s other writings, but what is of interest to us in this passage is the picture of what it is we are “ascending out of.” In this regard, it is helpful to recall the phrase used in Sixth Cartesian Meditation to describe the same thing, namely, “captivation-in-an-acceptedness.” The situation Fink is describing is this: the lives that we live in our everyday world are lived in toto with that world, i.e., the world, as we understand it, is part of what makes us who we think we are; and, conversely, the world is only what it is (what we think it is) by virtue of having us in it, because when we think of the totality of the world, we must remember that it is a totality already containing us thinking it. Hence, we (the world and ourselves) hold each other mutually captive by virtue of what we accept—the acceptednesses—to be true. This reflexive containment is part of what Fink means when he says, “To know the world by returning to a ‘transcendence’ which once again contains the world within it signifies the realization of a transcendental knowledge of the world. This is the sole sense in which phenomenology is to be considered as a ‘transcendental philosophy’” (Criticism, p. 100).

With this statement we finally arrive at the core of what Fink means to communicate; the phenomenological reduction is self-meditation radicalized. On its face, his statement may seem to involve the presupposition that the self is already estranged from its own essence; however, as Fink points out, “phenomenology does not begin with a ‘presupposition’; rather, by an extreme enhancement and transformation of the natural self-meditation, it leads to the ground-experience which opens-up not only the concealed-authentic essence of the spirit, but also the authentic sense of the natural sphere from out of which self-meditation comes forth” (Accomplish, p. 166/14-15). The ground-experience, furthermore, can succeed “only when, with the most extreme sharpness and consequence, every naïve claiming of the mundane-ontological self-understanding is cut off, when the spirit is forced back upon itself to Interpret itself purely as that ‘self’ which is the bearer and accomplisher of the valuation of every natural ‘self-understanding’” (p. 169/17-18). This view is already made explicit in direct connection with the phenomenological onlooker in Fink’s discussion in Sixth Cartesian Meditation (pp. 39-40). The meditation does not bring the reducing “I” into being; the reducing “I” is disclosed once the shrouding cover of human being is removed. That is, by un-humanizing ourselves we discover the reducing “I”—the phenomenological onlooker who is the one practicing the epoché.

Now we can more clearly grasp the meaning of Fink’s statement; when he speaks of spirit being “forced back upon itself,” the “itself” is the phenomenological onlooker—spirit; and the radicalization of self-meditation is the procedure whereby we discover what Husserl earlier referred to as “I am, this life is.” This is “radicalization” precisely because it is to be done without any reference to the mundane. Let me explain, the world is familiarly and horizonally pre-given to us in its totality; furthermore, we are pre-given in it. So, the mundane-ontological self-interpretedness of the spirit is a moment in the totality of the pre-givenness of the world. Hence, if we use any element of the mundane-ontological interpretedness of the world, we have not exercised a “radical” shift. In order for the shift to be truly radical in Husserl’s sense, no element of the mundane can enter into either the motivation for self-meditation or into the ground of it—in the sense of an understanding of the essence of spirit prior to the ground-experience that brings spirit to itself. What we want to accomplish is a radical shift in which the spirit (phenomenological onlooker) is forced back upon itself to interpret itself purely as that “self” that is the bearer (as the human ego) and accomplisher (transcendental constituting ego) of the valuation of the entirety of the mundane-ontological self-interpretedness.

The radical nature of the phenomenological reduction seems to have been greatly underdetermined by some and that we can only get a truly accurate picture of what Husserl means by taking seriously his claim that, not only is the reduction radical, but it is radical in a “new” sense of that term; this “new” radicality is linked directly to self-meditation that has been radicalized—radicalized, that is, insofar as it is a self-meditation that is “forced back upon itself to Interpret itself purely as that ‘self’ which is the bearer and accomplisher of the valuation of every natural ‘self-understanding.’” One practical way to grasp what it means for the self to be “forced back upon itself to interpret itself purely as that ‘self’ which is the bearer and accomplisher of the valuation of every natural ‘self-understanding,’” is to understand this ‘self’ as the “I” in “I am.” Let us now take a closer look at exactly how this technique is performed.

c. The Performance of the Phenomenological Reduction

Husserl criticizes scientific inquiry on the grounds that it does not have a philosophically rigorous foundation. The reason it does not have a philosophically rigorous foundation is because it has failed to take into consideration the fact that both the framework of its own inquiry (that is, the assumptions of time, space, causality, etc.) and the psychological assumptions of the individual scientist act to color its findings. Since there has to be a way that consciousness can contact the objective world, then the rigorous philosophical grounding that is wanted must be disclosed in this relationship. Hence, what is needed is a way to examine consciousness as it is in itself, free from the scientific framework and psychological assumptions. This procedure is the phenomenological reduction and the term “reduction” is a term that Husserl uses to indicate a reflective inquiring back into consciousness; it is an interrogation conducted by consciousness into itself. In the idiom of our own everyday parlance, we might phrase this inquiry as an exercise in determining who the “I” is whenever we say “I AM.” Indeed, the path that we naturally follow in seeking an answer to this question leads precisely to the kind of interrogation of the self by the self that Husserl and Fink both claim to be ingredient in the performance of the reduction.

i. Self-Meditation

Phrases such as “resolved to understand the world out of the spirit,” “spiritual movement,” “religious conversion,” “fundamental transformation,” “ground experience,” “un-humanize,” and “meditation” are all leading clues as to how this technique should be understood and performed. We know that the technique is similar to the ordinary self-meditation, only radicalized; we know that it requires strenuous effort and, once completed, brings a transformation similar to a religious conversion. We also know that in the process we are “un-humanized” yet have the “entire man” encompassed. These leading clues not only direct our steps in the performance of the technique, but also give us criteria by which to judge our attempts. For instance, if we think we have performed the reduction, then we should feel as though we have experienced a religious transformation; if we do not feel that way, then chances are our technique was faulty and we did not perform it after all.

If we are to build up a picture of this technique we must begin by assuming that Husserl and Fink have an authentic discovery that they are trying to communicate and that their choice of terms to describe this experience is not careless. The title of Fink’s article gives us the framework we need to complete this task. He tells us right away that he is interested in the idea of laying a ground. Laying a ground is another way of saying that preparation is being made; indeed, the ground that is laid is preparing the way for the phenomenological philosophy of Edmund Husserl; and the ground in question is the philosopher. Fink is telling us that the philosopher is the ground for phenomenology and that the philosopher, as ground, needs preparation. What is it that prepares the philosopher to be the ground for phenomenology? It is the phenomenological reduction. The phenomenological reduction prepares the philosopher to be a phenomenologist in the same way that the experience associated with religious conversion prepares the devotee to live the religious life. Husserl says in the Crisis: “the total phenomenological attitude and the epoché belonging to it are destined in essence to effect…a complete personal transformation, comparable in the beginning to a religious conversion, which then, however, over and above this, bears within itself the significance of the greatest existential transformation which is assigned as a task to mankind as such” (p.137).

The phenomenological reduction is properly understood as a regimen designed to transform a philosopher into a phenomenologist by virtue of the attainment of a certain perspective on the world phenomenon. The path to the attainment of this perspective is a species of meditation, requiring rigorous and persistent effort. It is a species of meditation because, unlike ordinary meditation, which involves only the mind, this more radical form requires the participation of the entire individual, including, as Fink says, “the pathos of the one who is philosophizing.” However, because it is a species of meditation, one can assume the basic starting point of stilling the body, mind, and emotions while sitting in a comfortable position, having made provisions not to be disturbed. What is aimed at with these outward preparations is the goal of taking as much of the world “out of play” as possible, leaving only the meditative task to occupy one’s attention.

Once settled in this comfort, the “inquiring back” into consciousness may begin; it is the having of the self as the only object of meditation that makes this a self-meditation. Since what we are after is a self-meditation, the focus of attention is on the self and the radicalization of this meditation consists in one relentlessly pushing back and forcing the self onto itself. This can be done by repeatedly affirming, not merely saying, “I am” to oneself while trying to experience or “catch” the “I” in the present instead of remembering it. In the attempt to experience the “I” in the present, one will be forced to feel the I-ness of it; this is why Fink says the performance of the technique encompasses the “entire man” and speaks of the “pathos of the one who is philosophizing.”

In the course of this practice, one will become aware of the three “I”s: the human ego, the constituting ego, and the onlooker, or spectator. It is unlikely that much progress will be made on the first attempt; however, each try makes the return easier until there will come a day when you feel your consciousness rising (or yourself sinking) and the brightness of the world around you seems to be increasing. At that point you will know “I AM” and your perspective on the world will be the one that Husserl has promised—you will be a phenomenologist and will never be the same again. Indeed, Fink says that “the phenomenological ‘epoché,’ is anything but a noncommittal, ‘merely’ theoretical, intellectual act; it is rather a spiritual [geistig] movement of one’s self encompassing the entire man and, as an attack upon the ‘state-of-motionlessness’ supporting us in our depths, the pain of a fundamental transformation down to our roots” (Accomplish, p. 9). Adding that in the epoché “the transcendental tendency that awakens in man and drives him to inhibit all acceptednesses nullifies man himself; man un-humanizes [entmenscht] himself” (Sixth, 40). It should be clear from these passages that whatever is involved in the epoché, it is certainly no mere mental exercise; and if we take Fink and Husserl at their word, it is a “spiritual movement of one’s self encompassing the entire man,” which would indicate a far more radical effort than seems indicated by some who treat the phenomenological reduction as something no more strenuous than exercising the imagination or reciting an incantation.

6. How the Reduction Solves the Epistemological Problem

a. The Problem of Constitution

I have already noted that in his Philosophy of Arithmetic Husserl found serious fault with psychologism in his efforts to emancipate ideal objects from psychology and demonstrate their independence. With this critique, however, came the following question: How do the ideal objects come to be given? This is simply the question concerning the correlation of subject and object noted above with respect to the tree and the quad. In his “The Decisive Phases in the Development of Husserl’s Philosophy,” Walter Biemel addresses this very concern and brings his considerable familiarity with Husserl’s works to bear upon it. He offers the following quotation from the Nachlass (F I 36, B1.19a f.) for consideration: “When it is made evident that ideal objects, despite the fact that they are formed in consciousness, have their own being in themselves, there still remains an enormous task which has never been seriously viewed or taken up, namely, the task of making this unique correlation between the ideal objects which belong to the sphere of pure logic and the subjective psychical experience conceived as a formative activity a theme for investigation. When a psychical subject such as I, this thinking being, performs certain (and surely not arbitrary but quite specifically structured) psychical activities in my own psychical life, then a successive formation and production of meaning is enacted according to which the number-form in question, the truth in question, or the conclusion and proof in question…emerges as the successively developing product.”

Biemel uses this quotation to make the point that in it Husserl expresses his real concern and the real theme of his phenomenology; Biemel draws our attention to the parenthetical phrase concerning psychical activities, namely, “(and surely not arbitrary but quite specifically structured),” to make the point that “the subject cannot arbitrarily constitute (and surely the issue here is that of constitution) any meaning whatsoever; rather are the constitutive acts dependent upon the essence of the objects in question.” In other words, if we are to consider the essence of the number three, for example, it is not the case that the essence of that number, contra psychologism, is dependent upon what psychical activities are required in order to form the number; rather, in order to understand the meaning of the number three, “we must perform determinate acts of collective connecting, otherwise the meaning of 3 in general will remain entirely closed to us. There is something like the number three for us when we can perform the collecting-unifying activity in which three become capable of being presented.” This does not mean that the essence of the number three would be arbitrarily determined by this activity so that the number would in each case change according to the manner in which one constitutes it. “Either I perform the acts which disclose the essence of the number three, with the result that for me there is something like three, or I do not perform them and then there is no 3 except for those who have performed this activity.” This “collecting-unifying activity” is the activity of constitution.

Biemel reminds us that the problem of constitution is the source of many a misunderstanding and adds, “the ordinary use of ‘constitution’ equates it with any kind of production, but ‘constitution’ in the strong sense is more of a ‘restitution’ than a constitution insofar as the subject ‘restores’ what is already there, but this, however, requires the performance of certain activities.” Citing a letter from Husserl to Hocking dated January 25, 1903, Biemel drives his point home: “Regarding the meaning of the concept of constitution employed in the Logical Investigations Husserl states: ‘The recurring expression that ‘objects are constituted’ in an act always signifies the property of an act which makes the object present (vorstellig): not ‘constitution’ in the usual sense.’” Hence, the best way to discuss the concept of constitution, says Biemel, is to discuss it as the-becoming-present-of-an-object; and the acts which make this becoming-present possible, which set it in motion, are the constituting acts. Or, as Husserl would put it in his Formal and Transcendental Logic, “This manner of givenness—givenness as something coming from such original activity—is nothing other than the way of their being ‘perceived’ which uniquely belongs to them.

This problem of constitution first appears in the Logical Investigations and continues to be one of the basic problems of phenomenology; however, the interest in it here is that constitution figures prominently in the resolution of the epistemological problem.

b. The Reduction and the Theme of Philosophy

In his “The Problem of the Phenomenology of Edmund Husserl,” Fink allows that access to the fundamental problem of Husserl’s phenomenology is uncertain owing to the fact that the fundamental problem of any philosophy is often not identical with the particular questions with which its literature begins. Indeed, the fundamental problem may often even await a proper formulation; one that can emerge only after the philosopher’s later stages of the development of his or her own thought are reworked. And although Husserl’s thought started with the sense-formation of mathematics and logic, these interests do not comprise what Fink terms the genuine problem or theme of phenomenology.

This very zigzag process of moving back and forth from one stage to the whole and back again within which the formulation of the genuine problem occurs discloses a distinction between two types of knowing. The first type is one in which we are engaged in a developmental process that will answer certain formulatable questions; that is, it is an expecting-to-know that is characterized chiefly by the fact that it advances an already established body of knowledge—in short, it is a knowing about knowledge that is lacking. For instance, in archaeology we might plan digs in areas surrounding certain cities expecting to add to our stock of knowledge about the ancient life in that setting in order to fill in known gaps in our accounts. This is knowledge of what is lacking.

This type of knowing is not, however, the type of knowing that emerges in the zigzag process to which I just referred. The type of knowing prevalent in the zigzag process is one in which what is obvious becomes questionable; not in the sense of creating arbitrary doubts or from the mere mistrust of the human mind; rather, questionable because, as Fink says, “philosophy is an experience that man has of himself and the existent;” and it is owing to this that the origin of philosophical problems is wonder. This means that “problem” in the philosophical sense is not an expecting-to-know on the basis of a path to knowledge but rather the formation of an expecting-to-know. Philosophy is, therefore, the shaking of the ground which bears human familiarity with the existent; it is the shaking of the basis which forms the presupposition for the progressive augmentation of knowledge, i.e., the shaking of the basis of expecting-to-know of the first type. It is the very unsettling of the foundations of knowledge and the questioning of the existent qua existent as well as the questioning of the nature of truth.

The astonishment in question is just the very experience that man has of himself and the existent that is the foundation needed for epistemology; because it is in this wonder that the “unsettling idea of a genuine mode of knowing the existent suddenly emerges from beneath the ordered, familiar world in which we are at home and about which we have fixed meanings concerning things, man and God, meanings which make certainty in life possible.” It is a “genuine mode” precisely because it is not already decided what the nature of the existent and the nature of truth are; after all, it cannot be original if the original formation of the ideas of “existent” and “truth” has already occurred; whether it is decided through a lengthy effort belonging to the past of human spirit or through the inconspicuous obviousness of the natural world-view. In other words, the only “knowing” that is original is the “knowing” that properly belongs to astonishment; because it is only in astonishment that man experiences the complete collapse of his traditional knowledge and pre-acquaintance with the world and with things; a collapse that is due entirely to a new confronting of the existent and a new projection of the senses of “being” and “truth.” We should be sensitive to Fink’s use of the term “original” here because the way he uses it in this passage heralds the sense of “founding” invoked in the way phenomenology provides a ground for epistemology.

Fink has told us that the astonishment in which philosophy begins is in no way “merely a ‘disposition,’ a feeling.” Rather, “it is the fundamental disposition of pure thought; it is original theory.” What Fink means to communicate with this is that in astonishment a change and transformation of knowing occurs such that what we already know is reduced to mere opinion and that even the very nature of knowing is altered. In other words, Fink marks a distinction between the “knowing” that stands in need of a foundation and the “knowing” that does the founding. The knowing that does the founding is the original knowing of astonishment; it is original precisely because it does not come to the existent and truth with conceptions in hand, having already decided their nature; and the door to sustained astonishment is opened by the rigorous performance of the phenomenological reduction.

It should not be inferred from this passage that there is anything whimsical about the way astonishment proclaims the existent; as though, for example, that being and truth are presented as mere conventions. Rather, what is wanted is the ability to, as Fink says, sustain and develop astonishment “by the awakening force of conceptual cognition” because it is the extent of the creative force of wonder that ultimately determines the rank and achievement of a philosophy. It is precisely this burden that is borne by the phenomenological reduction, which aims at voluntarily awakening the force of conceptual cognition and sustaining it throughout intentional analysis. Thus, it is borne out as was noted above that philosophy does not begin with an assumption but an experience; namely, the experience of having performed the phenomenological reduction. This experience is the astonishment in which original knowing occurs; and it is upon original knowing that the “knowing” of the existent, or epistemology, is grounded.

This relation, in which a physical experience is the condition for the possibility of thought, is not new to philosophy; logical analysis crucially depends upon one having the ability (experience) to be aware of logical connections; absent this ability, as Wittgenstein has also noticed, there is nothing we can do to atone for it in the individual—the individual either sees the logical connections or does not. It is the experience of being aware of, and noticing, logical connections that really grounds logical analysis. So, too, with the phenomenological reduction; without the experience of astonishment granted by having successfully performed the phenomenological reduction, no epistemology can be truly grounded because every epistemological claim must sometime trace itself back to the original knowledge; and the original knowledge can be had only in astonishment, the very fruit of accurately performing the phenomenological reduction. In other words, the ground for epistemology is, in the final analysis, the philosopher’s own astonishment; if this astonishment is voluntarily taken up and sustained, as in the performance of the phenomenological reduction, then the report of what is disclosed in that experience can be entered into the stock of human knowledge as an epistemological datum. And, in the same way that the validity of any logical argument is verified by each individual at every step by seeing for him or herself whether each step follows logically from the previous step by invoking one’s own ability to recognize logical connections, every epistemological datum must be similarly verified by the phenomenologist returning to astonishment through the phenomenological reduction and comparing the results achieved with those at hand. What is needed to assure consistent results and the scientific rigor Husserl said properly belonged to phenomenology is a more careful adherence to the rigorous conditions of performing the phenomenological reduction by phenomenologists so that it does not deteriorate into the psychologistic practice of free association or mere mental exercise; it is, after all, a rigorous meditative exercise requiring the struggle of the whole person.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Berger, Gaston. The Cogito in Husserl's Philosophy. Translated by Kathleen McLaughlin. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1972.
  • Bernet, Rudolf. “Phenomenological Reduction and the Double Life of the Subject.” In Reading Heidegger from the Start: Essays in His Earliest Thought, eds. Theodore Kisiel and John van Buren, Albany: SUNY Press, 1994.
  • Bernet, Rudolf, Iso Kern, and Eduard Marbach. An Introduction to Husserlian Phenomenology. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1993.
  • Biemel, Walter. “Les Phases decisive dans le development de la philosophie de Husserl.” In Husserl: Cahiers de Royaumont, no III. Paris: Minuit, 1959.
  • Bochiniski, I.M. Contemporary European Philosophy. Translated by Donald Nicholl and Karl Aschenbrenner. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1966.
  • Boehm, Rudolf. “Basic Reflections on Husserl’s Phenomenological Reduction.” International Philosophical Quarterly 5 (1965): 183-202.
  • Boehm, Rudolf. “Les Ambiguités des Concepts Husserliens d’‘immanence’ et de ‘transcendence.’” Revue Philosophique de la France et de l’Etranger 149 (1959): 481-526.
  • Boehm, Rudolf. Vom Gesichtspunkt der Phänomenologie. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1968.
  • Boehm, Rudolf. Vom Gesichtspunkt der Phänomenologie II. Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1981.
  • Bruzina, Ronald. “Construction in Phenomenology.” In The Reach of Reflection: Issues for Phenomenology’s Second Century, eds. Steven Crowell, Lester Embree, and Samuel J. Julian (Electron Press, October 2001), 46-71.
  • Bruzina, Ronald. Edmund Husserl and Eugen Fink: Beginnings and Ends in Phenomenology 1928-1938. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004.
  • Carr, David. “The ‘Fifth Meditation’ and Husserl’s Cartesianism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research. 34:14-35, 1973.
  • Carr, David. The Paradox of Subjectivity: The Self in the Transcendental Tradition. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Depraz, Natalie, and Marc Richir, eds. Eugen Fink: Actes Du Colloque de Cerisy-la-Salle 23-30 Juillet 1994. Atlanta: Rodopi, 1997.
  • Elveton, R. O., ed. The Phenomenology of Husserl: Selected Readings. Chicago:Quadrangle Books, 1970.
  • Farber, Marvin. The Aims of Phenomenology: The Motives, Methods, and Impact of Husserl's Thought. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1966.
  • Farber, Marvin. The Foundation of Phenomenology: Edmund Husserl and the Quest for a Rigorous Science of Philosophy. Albany: SUNY Press, 1943.
  • Fink, Eugen. “L’Analyse intentionnelle et le probleme de la pensee speculative.” In Problemes actuels de la phenomenologie, 54-87. Brussels: Desclee de Brower, 1952.
  • Fink, Eugen. “The Phenomenological Philosophy of Edmund Husserl and Contemporary Criticism.” In The Phenomenology of Husserl, 73-147. Chicago: Quadrangle Books, 1970.
  • Fink, Eugen. Sixth Cartesian Meditation: The Idea of a Transcendental Theory of Method. Translated by Ronald Bruzina. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1995.
  • Fink, Eugen. “Was Will Die Phänomenologie Edmund Husserls,” in Studien zur Phänomenologie 1930-1939 (Den Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1966).
  • Fink, Eugen. “What Does the Phenomenology of Edmund Husserl Want to Accomplish?” Translated by Arthur Grugan. Research in Phenomenology 2, (1972): 5-27.
  • Hopkins, Burt C. “Husserl’s Account of Phenomenological Reflection and Four Paradoxes of Reflexivity.” Research in Phenomenology 19, (1989): 180-194.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Analyses Concerning Passive and Active Synthesis: Lectures on Transcendental Logic. Translated by Anthony J. Steinbock. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 2001.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Cartesian Meditations. Translated by Dorion Cairns. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1977.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Crisis of European Sciences and Transcendental Phenomenology. Translated by David Carr. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Husserliana Vol. VIII. Erste Philosophie (1923/24), II. Edited by Rudolf Boehm. Haag: Martinus Nijhoff, 1959.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Experience and Judgment. Translated by James S. Churchill and Karl Ameriks. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Formal and Transcendental Logic. Translated by Dorion Cairns. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1969.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Idea of Phenomenology. Translated by William P. Alston and George Nakhnikian. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1973.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Idea of Phenomenology. Translated by Lee Hardy. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1999.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy: First Book. Translated by F. Kersten. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1998.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas Pertaining to a Pure Phenomenology and to a Phenomenological Philosophy: Second Book. Translated by R. Rojcewicz and A. Schuwer. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, 1989.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Ideas: General Introduction to Pure Phenomenology. Translated by W. F. Boyce Gibson. New York: Collier Books, 1962.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Logical Investigations. Translated by J. N. Findlay. 2Vols. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1970.
  • Husserl, Edmund. Phenomenology and the Crisis of Philosophy. Translated by Quentin Lauer. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1965.
  • Husserl, Edmund. The Phenomenology of Internal Time-consciousness. Translated by James S. Churchill. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1964.
  • Kearney, Richard and Mara Rainwater, eds. The Continental Philosophy Reader. London: Routledge, 1998.
  • Kersten, Fred. “Notes From Underground: Merleau-Ponty and Husserl’s Sixth Cartesian Meditation.” In The Prism of the Self, ed. Steven Crowell. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, no date.
  • Kockelmans, Joseph J, ed. Phenomenology: The Philosophy of Edmund Husserl and Its Interpretation. Garden City, New York: Doubleday, 1967.
  • Lauer, Quentin. Phenomenology: Its Genesis and Prospect. New York: Harper Torchbooks, 1965.
  • Lawlor, Leonard. Derrida and Husserl: The Basic Problem of Phenomenology. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2002.
  • McKenna, William, Robert M. Harlan and Laurence E. Winters, eds. Apriori and World: European Contributions to Husserlian Phenomenology. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1981.
  • Natanson, Maurice. Edmund Husserl: Philosopher of Infinite Tasks. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1973.
  • Ricoeur, Paul. “Husserl’s Fifth Cartesian Meditation.” In Husserl: An Analysis of His Phenomenology. Translated by Edward G. Ballard and Lester Embree. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1967.
  • Ricoeur, Paul. “A Study of Husserl's Cartesian Meditations I-IV.” In Husserl An Analysis of His Phenomenology. Translated by Edward G. Ballard and Lester Embree. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1967.
  • Sokolowski, Robert. Husserlian Meditations. Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1974.
  • Souche-Daques, S. “La Lecture Husserlienne de Sein und Zeit.” Philosophie 21 (1989): 7-36.
  • Stapleton, Timothy J. “The ‘Logic’ of Husserl’s Transcendental Reduction.” Man and World 15 (1982): 369-382.
  • Welton, Donn, ed. The Essential Husserl: Basic Writings in Transcendental Phenomenology. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1999.
  • Welton, Donn, ed. The New Husserl: A Critical Reader. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2003.
  • Zahavi, Dan. Husserl and Transcendental Intersubjectivity. Translated by Elizabeth A. Behnke. Athens, Ohio: Ohio University Press, 2001.
  • Zahavi, Dan. Husserl’s Phenomenology. Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2003.

Author Information

John Cogan
St. Petersburg College
U. S. A.

Descartes, Rene: Mind-Body Distinction

René Descartes:
The Mind-Body Distinction

descarteOne of the deepest and most lasting legacies of Descartes’ philosophy is his thesis that mind and body are really distinct—a thesis now called "mind-body dualism." He reaches this conclusion by arguing that the nature of the mind (that is, a thinking, non-extended thing) is completely different from that of the body (that is, an extended, non-thinking thing), and therefore it is possible for one to exist without the other. This argument gives rise to the famous problem of mind-body causal interaction still debated today: how can the mind cause some of our bodily limbs to move (for example, raising one's hand to ask a question), and how can the body’s sense organs cause sensations in the mind when their natures are completely different? This article examines these issues as well as Descartes’ own response to this problem through his brief remarks on how the mind is united with the body to form a human being. This will show how these issues arise because of a misconception about Descartes’ theory of mind-body union, and how the correct conception of their union avoids this version of the problem. The article begins with an examination of the term “real distinction” and of Descartes’ probable motivations for maintaining his dualist thesis.

Table of Contents

  1. What is a Real Distinction?
  2. Why a Real Distinction?
    1. The Religious Motivation
    2. The Scientific Motivation
  3. The Real Distinction Argument
    1. The First Version
    2. The Second Version
  4. The Mind-Body Problem
  5. Descartes’ Response to the Mind-Body Problem
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. What is a Real Distinction?

It is important to note that for Descartes “real distinction” is a technical term denoting the distinction between two or more substances (see Principles, part I, section 60). A substance is something that does not require any other creature to exist—it can exist with only the help of God’s concurrence—whereas, a mode is a quality or affection of that substance (see Principles part I, section 5). Accordingly, a mode requires a substance to exist and not just the concurrence of God. Being sphere shaped is a mode of an extended substance. For example, a sphere requires an object extended in three dimensions in order to exist: an unextended sphere cannot be conceived without contradiction. But a substance can be understood to exist alone without requiring any other creature to exist. For example, a stone can exist all by itself. That is, its existence is not dependent upon the existence of minds or other bodies; and, a stone can exist without being any particular size or shape. This indicates for Descartes that God, if he chose, could create a world constituted by this stone all by itself, showing further that it is a substance “really distinct” from everything else except God. Hence, the thesis that mind and body are really distinct just means that each could exist all by itself without any other creature, including each other, if God chose to do it. However, this does not mean that these substances do exist separately. Whether or not they actually exist apart is another issue entirely.

2. Why a Real Distinction?

A question one might ask is: what's the point of arguing that mind and body could each exist without the other? What’s the payoff for going through all the trouble and enduring all the problems to which it gives rise? For Descartes the payoff is twofold. The first is religious in nature in that it provides a rational basis for a hope in the soul’s immortality [because Descartes presumes that the mind and soul are more or less the same thing]. The second is more scientifically oriented, for the complete absence of mentality from the nature of physical things is central to making way for Descartes’ version of the new, mechanistic physics. This section investigates both of these motivating factors.

a. The Religious Motivation

In his Letter to the Sorbonne published at the beginning of his seminal work, Meditations on First Philosophy, Descartes states that his purpose in showing that the human mind or soul is really distinct from the body is to refute those “irreligious people” who only have faith in mathematics and will not believe in the soul's immortality without a mathematical demonstration of it. Descartes goes on to explain how, because of this, these people will not pursue moral virtue without the prospect of an afterlife with rewards for virtue and punishments for vice. But, since all the arguments in the Meditations—including the real distinction arguments— are for Descartes absolutely certain on a par with geometrical demonstrations, he believes that these people will be obliged to accept them. Hence, irreligious people will be forced to believe in the prospect of an afterlife. However, recall that Descartes’ conclusion is only that the mind or soul can exist without the body. He stops short of demonstrating that the soul is actually immortal. Indeed, in the Synopsis to the Mediations, Descartes claims only to have shown that the decay of the body does not logically or metaphysically imply the destruction of the mind: further argumentation is required for the conclusion that the mind actually survives the body's destruction. This would involve both “an account of the whole of physics” and an argument showing that God cannot annihilate the mind. Yet, even though the real distinction argument does not go this far, it does, according to Descartes, provide a sufficient foundation for religion, since the hope for an afterlife now has a rational basis and is no longer a mere article of faith.

b. The Scientific Motivation

The other motive for arguing that mind and body could each exist without the other is more scientifically oriented, stemming from Descartes’ intended replacement of final causal explanations in physics thought to be favored by late scholastic-Aristotelian philosophers with mechanistic explanations based on the model of geometry. Although the credit for setting the stage for this scholastic-Aristotelian philosophy dominant at Descartes’ time should go to Thomas Aquinas (because of his initial, thorough interpretation and appropriation of Aristotle’s philosophy), it is also important to bear in mind that other thinkers working within this Aristotelian framework such as Duns Scotus, William of Ockham, and Francisco Suarez, diverged from the Thomistic position on a variety of important issues. Indeed, by Descartes’ time, scholastic positions divergent from Thomism became so widespread and subtle in their differences that sorting them out was quite difficult. Notwithstanding this convoluted array of positions, Descartes understood one thesis to stand at the heart of the entire tradition: the doctrine that everything ultimately behaved for the sake of some end or goal. Though these “final causes,” as they were called, were not the only sorts of causes recognized by scholastic thinkers, it is sufficient for present purposes to recognize that Descartes believed scholastic natural philosophers used them as principles for physical explanations. For this reason, a brief look at how final causes were supposed to work is in order.

Descartes understood all scholastics to maintain that everything was thought to have a final cause that is the ultimate end or goal for the sake of which the rest of the organism was organized. This principle of organization became known as a thing’s “substantial form,” because it was this principle that explained why some hunk of matter was arranged in such and such a way so as to be some species of substance. For example, in the case of a bird, say, the swallow, the substantial form of swallowness was thought to organize matter for the sake of being a swallow species of substance. Accordingly, any dispositions a swallow might have, such as the disposition for making nests, would then also be explained by means of this ultimate goal of being a swallow; that is, swallows are disposed for making nests for the sake of being a swallow species of substance. This explanatory scheme was also thought to work for plants and inanimate natural objects.

A criticism of the traditional employment of substantial forms and their concomitant final causes in physics is found in the Sixth Replies where Descartes examines how the quality of gravity was used to explain a body’s downward motion:

But what makes it especially clear that my idea of gravity was taken largely from the idea I had of the mind is the fact that I thought that gravity carried bodies toward the centre of the earth as if it had some knowledge of the centre within itself (AT VII 442: CSM II 298).

On this pre-Newtonian account, a characteristic goal of all bodies was to reach its proper place, namely, the center of the earth. So, the answer to the question, “Why do stones fall downward?” would be, “Because they are striving to achieve their goal of reaching the center of the earth.” According to Descartes, this implies that the stone must have knowledge of this goal, know the means to attain it, and know where the center of the earth is located. But, how can a stone know anything? Surely only minds can have knowledge. Yet, since stones are inanimate bodies without minds, it follows that they cannot know anything at all—let alone anything about the center of the earth.

Descartes continues on to make the following point:

But later on I made the observations which led me to make a careful distinction between the idea of the mind and the ideas of body and corporeal motion; and I found that all those other ideas of . . . 'substantial forms' which I had previously held were ones which I had put together or constructed from those basic ideas (AT VII 442-3: CSM II 298).

Here, Descartes is claiming that the concept of a substantial form as part of the entirely physical world stems from a confusion of the ideas of mind and body. This confusion led people to mistakenly ascribe mental properties like knowledge to entirely non-mental things like stones, plants, and, yes, even non-human animals. The real distinction of mind and body can then also be used to alleviate this confusion and its resultant mistakes by showing that bodies exist and move as they do without mentality, and as such principles of mental causation such as goals, purposes (that is, final causes), and knowledge have no role to play in the explanation of physical phenomena. So the real distinction of mind and body also serves the more scientifically oriented end of eliminating any element of mentality from the idea of body. In this way, a clear understanding of the geometrical nature of bodies can be achieved and better explanations obtained.

3. The Real Distinction Argument

Descartes formulates this argument in many different ways, which has led many scholars to believe there are several different real distinction arguments. However, it is more accurate to consider these formulations as different versions of one and the same argument. The fundamental premise of each is identical: each has the fundamental premise that the natures of mind and body are completely different from one another.

The First Version

The first version is found in this excerpt from the Sixth Meditation:

[O]n the one hand I have a clear and distinct idea of myself, in so far as I am simply a thinking, non-extended thing [that is, a mind], and on the other hand I have a distinct idea of body, in so far as this is simply an extended, non-thinking thing. And accordingly, it is certain that I am really distinct from my body, and can exist without it (AT VII 78: CSM II 54).

Notice that the argument is given from the first person perspective (as are the entire Meditations). This “I” is, of course, Descartes insofar as he is a thinking thing or mind, and the argument is intended to work for any “I” or mind. So, for present purposes, it is safe to generalize the argument by replacing “I” with “mind” in the relevant places:

  1. I have a clear and distinct idea of the mind as a thinking, non-extended thing.
  2. I have a clear and distinct idea of body as an extended, non-thinking thing.
  3. Therefore, the mind is really distinct from the body and can exist without it.

At first glance it may seem that, without justification, Descartes is bluntly asserting that he conceives of mind and body as two completely different things, and that from his conception, he is inferring that he (or any mind) can exist without the body. But this is no blunt, unjustified assertion. Much more is at work here: most notably what is at work is his doctrine of clear and distinct ideas and their veridical guarantee. Indeed the truth of his intellectual perception of the natures of mind and body is supposed to be guaranteed by the fact that this perception is “clear and distinct.” Since the justification for these two premises rests squarely on the veridical guarantee of whatever is “clearly and distinctly” perceived, a brief side trip explaining this doctrine is in order.

Descartes explains what he means by a “clear and distinct idea” in his work Principles of Philosophy at part I, section 45. Here he likens a clear intellectual perception to a clear visual perception. So, just as someone might have a sharply focused visual perception of something, an idea is clear when it is in sharp intellectual focus. Moreover, an idea is distinct when, in addition to being clear, all other ideas not belonging to it are completely excluded from it. Hence, Descartes is claiming in both premises that his idea of the mind and his idea of the body exclude all other ideas that do not belong to them, including each other, and all that remains is what can be clearly understood of each. As a result, he clearly and distinctly understands the mind all by itself, separately from the body, and the body all by itself, separately from the mind.

According to Descartes, his ability to clearly and distinctly understand them separately from one another implies that each can exist alone without the other. This is because “[e]xistence is contained in the idea or concept of every single thing, since we cannot conceive of anything except as existing. Possible or contingent existence is contained in the concept of a limited thing...” (AT VII 166: CSM II 117). Descartes, then, clearly and distinctly perceives the mind as possibly existing all by itself, and the body as possibly existing all by itself. But couldn't Descartes somehow be mistaken about his clear and distinct ideas? Given the existence of so many non-thinking bodies like stones, there is no question that bodies can exist without minds. So, even if he could be mistaken about what he clearly and distinctly understands, there is other evidence in support of premise 2. But can minds exist without bodies? Can thinking occur without a brain? If the answer to this question is “no,” the first premise would be false and, therefore, Descartes would be mistaken about one of his clear and distinct perceptions. Indeed, since we have no experience of minds actually existing without bodies as we do of bodies actually existing without minds, the argument will stand only if Descartes’ clear and distinct understanding of the mind’s nature somehow guarantees the truth of premise 1; but, at this point, it is not evident whether Descartes’ “clear and distinct” perception guarantees the truth of anything.

However, in the Fourth Meditation, Descartes goes to great lengths to guarantee the truth of whatever is clearly and distinctly understood. This veridical guarantee is based on the theses that God exists and that he cannot be a deceiver. These arguments, though very interesting, are numerous and complex, and so they will not be discussed here. Suffice it to say that since Descartes believes he has established God’s inability to deceive with absolute, geometrical certainty, he would have to consider anything contradicting this conclusion to be false. Moreover, Descartes claims that he cannot help but believe clear and distinct ideas to be true. However, if God put a clear and distinct idea in him that was false, then he could not help but believe a falsehood to be true and, to make matters worse, he would never be able to discover the mistake. Since God would be the author of this false clear and distinct idea, he would be the source of the error and would, therefore, be a deceiver, which must be false. Hence, all clear and distinct ideas must be true, because it is impossible for them to be false given God’s non-deceiving nature.

That said, the clarity and distinctness of Descartes’ understanding of mind and body guarantees the truth of premise 1. Hence, both “clear and distinct” premises are not blunt, unjustified assertions of what he believes but have very strong rational support from within Descartes’ system. However, if it turns out that God does not exist or that he can be a deceiver, then all bets are off. There would then no longer be any veridical guarantee of what is clearly and distinctly understood and, as a result, the first premise could be false. Consequently, premise 1 would not bar the possibility of minds requiring brains to exist and, therefore, this premise would not be absolutely certain as Descartes supposed. In the end, the conclusion is established with absolute certainty only when considered from within Descartes’ own epistemological framework but loses its force if that framework turns out to be false or when evaluated from outside of it.

These guaranteed truths express some very important points about Descartes’ conception of mind and body. Notice that mind and body are defined as complete opposites. This means that the ideas of mind and body represent two natures that have absolutely nothing in common. And, it is this complete diversity that establishes the possibility of their independent existence. But, how can Descartes make a legitimate inference from his independent understanding of mind and body as completely different things to their independent existence? To answer this question, recall that every idea of limited or finite things contains the idea of possible or contingent existence, and so Descartes is conceiving mind and body as possibly existing all by themselves without any other creature. Since there is no doubt about this possibility for Descartes and given the fact that God is all powerful, it follows that God could bring into existence a mind without a body and vice versa just as Descartes clearly and distinctly understands them. Hence, the power of God makes Descartes’ perceived logical possibility of minds existing without bodies into a metaphysical possibility. As a result, minds without bodies and bodies without minds would require nothing besides God’s concurrence to exist and, therefore, they are two really distinct substances.

The Second Version

The argument just examined is formulated in a different way later in the Sixth Meditation:

[T]here is a great difference between the mind and the body, inasmuch as the body is by its very nature always divisible, while the mind is utterly indivisible. For when I consider the mind, or myself in so far as I am merely a thinking thing, I am unable to distinguish any parts within myself; I understand myself to be something quite single and complete….By contrast, there is no corporeal or extended thing that I can think of which in my thought I cannot easily divide into parts; and this very fact makes me understand that it is divisible. This one argument would be enough to show me that the mind is completely different from the body…. (AT VII 86-87: CSM II 59).

This argument can be reformulated as follows, replacing “mind” for “I” as in the first version:

  1. I understand the mind to be indivisible by its very nature.
  2. I understand body to be divisible by its very nature.
  3. Therefore, the mind is completely different from the body.

Notice the conclusion that mind and body are really distinct is not explicitly stated but can be inferred from 3. What is interesting about this formulation is how Descartes reaches his conclusion. He does not assert a clear and distinct understanding of these two natures as completely different but instead makes his point based on a particular property of each. However, this is not just any property but a property each has “by its very nature.” Something’s nature is just what it is to be that kind of thing, and so the term “nature” is here being used as synonymous with “essence.” On this account, extension constitutes the nature or essence of bodily kinds of things; while thinking constitutes the nature or essence of mental kinds of things. So, here Descartes is arguing that a property of what it is to be a body, or extended thing, is to be divisible, while a property of what it is to be a mind or thinking thing is to be indivisible.

Descartes’ line of reasoning in support of these claims about the respective natures of mind and body runs as follows. First, it is easy to see that bodies are divisible. Just take any body, say a pencil or a piece of paper, and break it or cut it in half. Now you have two bodies instead of one. Second, based on this line of reasoning, it is easy to see why Descartes believed his nature or mind to be indivisible: if a mind or an “I” could be divided, then two minds or “I’s” would result; but since this “I” just is my self, this would be the same as claiming that the division of my mind results in two selves, which is absurd. Therefore, the body is essentially divisible and the mind is essentially indivisible: but how does this lead to the conclusion that they are completely different?

Here it should be noted that a difference in just any non-essential property would have only shown that mind and body are not exactly the same. But this is a much weaker claim than Descartes’ conclusion that they are completely different. For two things could have the same nature, for example, extension, but have other, changeable properties or modes distinguishing them. Hence, these two things would be different in some respect, for example, in shape, but not completely different, since both would still be extended kinds of things. Consequently, Descartes needs their complete diversity to claim that he has completely independent conceptions of each and, in turn, that mind and body can exist independently of one another.

Descartes can reach this stronger conclusion because these essential properties are contradictories. On the one hand, Descartes argues that the mind is indivisible because he cannot perceive himself as having any parts. On the other hand, the body is divisible because he cannot think of a body except as having parts. Hence, if mind and body had the same nature, it would be a nature both with and without parts. Yet such a thing is unintelligible: how could something both be separable into parts and yet not separable into parts? The answer is that it can’t, and so mind and body cannot be one and the same but two completely different natures. Notice that, as with the first version, mind and body are here being defined as opposites. This implies that divisible body can be understood without indivisible mind and vice versa. Accordingly each can be understood as existing all by itself: they are two really distinct substances.

However, unlike the first version, Descartes does not invoke the doctrine of clear and distinct ideas to justify his premises. If he had, this version, like the first, would be absolutely certain from within Descartes’ own epistemological system. But if removed from this apparatus, it is possible that Descartes is mistaken about the indivisibility of the mind, because the possibility of the mind requiring a brain to exist would still be viable. This would mean that, since extension is part of the nature of mind, it would, being an extended thing, be composed of parts and, therefore, it would be divisible. As a result, Descartes could not legitimately reach the conclusion that mind and body are completely different. This would also mean that the further, implicit conclusion that mind and body are really distinct could not be reached either. In the end, the main difficulty with Descartes’ real distinction argument is that he has not adequately eliminated the possibility of minds being extended things like brains.

4. The Mind-Body Problem

The real distinction of mind and body based on their completely diverse natures is the root of the famous mind-body problem: how can these two substances with completely different natures causally interact so as to give rise to a human being capable of having voluntary bodily motions and sensations? Although several versions of this problem have arisen over the years, this section will be exclusively devoted to the version of it Descartes confronted as expressed by Pierre Gassendi, the author of the Fifth Objections, and Descartes’ correspondent, Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia. Their concern arises from the claim at the heart of the real distinction argument that mind and body are completely different or opposite things.

The complete diversity of their respective natures has serious consequences for the kinds of modes each can possess. For instance, in the Second Meditation, Descartes argues that he is nothing but a thinking thing or mind, that is, Descartes argues that he is a “thing that doubts, understands, affirms, denies, is willing, is unwilling, and also imagines and has sensory perceptions” (AT VII 28: CSM II 19). It makes no sense to ascribe such modes to entirely extended, non-thinking things like stones, and therefore, only minds can have these kinds of modes. Conversely, it makes no sense to ascribe modes of size, shape, quantity and motion to non-extended, thinking things. For example, the concept of an unextended shape is unintelligible. Therefore, a mind cannot be understood to be shaped or in motion, nor can a body understand or sense anything. Human beings, however, are supposed to be combinations of mind and body such that the mind’s choices can cause modes of motion in the body, and motions in certain bodily organs, such as the eye, cause modes of sensation in the mind.

The mind’s ability to cause motion in the body will be addressed first. Take for example a voluntary choice, or willing, to raise one’s hand in class to ask a question. The arm moving upward is the effect while the choice to raise it is the cause. But willing is a mode of the non-extended mind alone, whereas the arm’s motion is a mode of the extended body alone: how can the non-extended mind bring about this extended effect? It is this problem of voluntary bodily motion or the so-called problem of “mind to body causation” that so troubled Gassendi and Elizabeth. The crux of their concern was that in order for one thing to cause motion in another, they must come into contact with one another as, for example, in the game of pool the cue ball must be in motion and come into contact with the eight-ball in order for the latter to be set in motion. The problem is that, in the case of voluntarily bodily movements, contact between mind and body would be impossible given the mind’s non-extended nature. This is because contact must be between two surfaces, but surface is a mode of body, as stated at Principles of Philosophy part II, section 15. Accordingly, the mind does not have a surface that can come into contact with the body and cause it to move. So, it seems that if mind and body are completely different, there is no intelligible explanation of voluntary bodily movement.

Although Gassendi and Elizabeth limited themselves to the problem of voluntary bodily movement, a similar problem arises for sensations, or the so-called problem of “body to mind causation.” For instance, a visual sensation of a tree is a mode of the mind alone. The cause of this mode would be explained by the motion of various imperceptible bodies causing parts of the eye to move, then movements in the optic nerve, which in turn cause various “animal spirits” to move in the brain and finally result in the sensory idea of the tree in the mind. But how can the movement of the “animal spirits,” which were thought to be very fine bodies, bring about the existence of a sensory idea when the mind is incapable of receiving modes of motion given its non-extended nature? Again, since the mind is incapable of having motion and a surface, no intelligible explanation of sensations seems possible either. Therefore, the completely different natures of mind and body seem to render their causal interaction impossible.

The consequences of this problem are very serious for Descartes, because it undermines his claim to have a clear and distinct understanding of the mind without the body. For humans do have sensations and voluntarily move some of their bodily limbs and, if Gassendi and Elizabeth are correct, this requires a surface and contact. Since the mind must have a surface and a capacity for motion, the mind must also be extended and, therefore, mind and body are not completely different. This means the “clear and distinct” ideas of mind and body, as mutually exclusive natures, must be false in order for mind-body causal interaction to occur. Hence, Descartes has not adequately established that mind and body are two really distinct substances.

5. Descartes’ Response to the Mind-Body Problem

Despite the obviousness of this problem, and the amount of attention given to it, Descartes himself never took this issue very seriously. His response to Gassendi is a telling example:

These questions presuppose amongst other things an explanation of the union between the soul and the body, which I have not yet dealt with at all. But I will say, for your benefit at least, that the whole problem contained in such questions arises simply from a supposition that is false and cannot in any way be proved, namely that, if the soul and the body are two substances whose nature is different, this prevents them from being able to act on each other (AT VII 213: CSM II 275).

So, Descartes’ response to the mind-body problem is twofold. First, Descartes contends that a response to this question presupposes an explanation of the union between the mind (or soul) and the body. Second, Descartes claims that the question itself stems from the false presupposition that two substances with completely different natures cannot act on each other. Further examination of these two points will occur in reverse order.

Descartes’ principles of causation put forward in the Third Meditation lie at the heart of this second presupposition. The relevant portion of this discussion is when Descartes argues that the less real cannot cause something that is more real, because the less real does not have enough reality to bring about something more real than itself. This principle applies on the general level of substances and modes. On this account, an infinite substance, that is, God, is the most real thing because only he requires nothing else in order to exist; created, finite substances are next most real, because they require only God’s creative and conservative activity in order to exist; and finally, modes are the least real, because they require a created substance and an infinite substance in order to exist. So, on this principle, a mode cannot cause the existence of a substance since modes are less real than finite substances. Similarly, a created, finite substance cannot cause the existence of an infinite substance. But a finite substance can cause the existence of another finite substance or a mode (since modes are less real than substances). Hence, Descartes’ point could be that the completely diverse natures of mind and body do not violate this causal principle, since both are finite substances causing modes to exist in some other finite substance. This indicates further that the “activity” of the mind on the body does not require contact and motion, thereby suggesting that mind and body do not bear a mechanistic causal relation to each other. More will be said about this below.

The first presupposition concerns an explanation of how the mind is united with the body. Descartes’ remarks about this issue are scattered across both his published works and his private correspondence. These texts indicate that Descartes did not maintain that voluntary bodily movements and sensation arise because of the causal interaction of mind and body by contact and motion. Rather, he maintains a version of the form-matter theory of soul-body union endorsed by some of his scholastic-Aristotelian predecessors and contemporaries. Although a close analysis of the texts in question cannot be conducted here, a brief summary of how this theory works for Descartes can be provided.

Before providing this summary, however, it is important to disclaim that this scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation is a minority position amongst Descartes scholars. The traditional view maintains that Descartes’ human being is composed of two substances that causally interact in a mechanistic fashion. This traditional view led some of Descartes’ successors, such as Malebranche and Leibniz (who also believed in the real distinction of mind and body), to devise metaphysical systems wherein mind and body do not causally interact despite appearances to the contrary. Other philosophers considered the mind-body problem to be insurmountable, thereby denying their real distinction: they claim that everything is either extended (as is common nowadays) or mental (as George Berkeley argued in the 18th century). Indeed, this traditional, mechanistic interpretation of Descartes is so deeply ingrained in the minds of philosophers today, that most do not even bother to argue for it. However, a notable exception is Marleen Rozemond, who argues for the incompatibility of Descartes’ metaphysics with any scholastic-Aristotelian version of mind or soul-body union. Those interested in closely examining her arguments should consult her book Descartes’s Dualism. A book arguing in favor of the scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation is entitled Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature; Chapter 5 specifically addresses Rozemond’s concerns.

Two major stumbling blocks Rozemond raises for the scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation concern the mind’s status as a substantial form and the extent to which Descartes can maintain a form of the human body. However, recall that Descartes rejects substantial forms because of their final causal component. Descartes’ argument was based on the fact (as he understood it) that the scholastics were ascribing mental properties to entirely non-mental things like stones. Since the mind is an entirely mental thing, these arguments just do not apply to it. Hence, Descartes’ particular rejection of substantial forms does not necessarily imply that Descartes did not view the mind as a substantial form. Indeed, as Paul Hoffman noted:

Descartes really rejects the attempt to use the human soul as a model for explanations in the entirely physical world. This makes it possible that Descartes considered the human mind to be the only substantial form. At first glance this may seem ad hoc but it is also important to notice that rejecting the existence of substantial forms with the exception of the mind or rational soul was not uncommon amongst Descartes’ contemporaries.

Although the mind’s status as a substantial form may seem at risk because of its meager explicit textual support, Descartes suggests that the mind a “substantial form” twice in a draft of open letter to his enemy Voetius:

Yet, if the soul is recognized as merely a substantial form, while other such forms consist in the configuration and motion of parts, this very privileged status it has compared with other forms shows that its nature is quite different from theirs (AT III 503: CSMK 207-208).

Descartes then remarks “this is confirmed by the example of the soul, which is the true substantial form of man” (AT III 508: CSMK 208). Although other passages do not make this claim explicitly, they do imply (in some sense) that the mind is a substantial form. For instance, Descartes claims in a letter to Mesland dated 9 February 1645, that the soul is “substantially united” with the human body (AT IV 166: CSMK 243). This “substantial union” was a technical term amongst the scholastics denoting the union between a substantial form and matter to form a complete substance. Consequently, there is some reason for believing that the human mind is the only substantial form left standing in Descartes’ metaphysics.

Another major stumbling block recognized by Rozemond is the extent to which, if any, Descartes’ metaphysics can maintain a principle for organizing extension into a human body. This was a point of some controversy amongst the scholastics themselves. Philosophers maintaining a Thomistic position argued that the human soul is the human body’s principle of organization. While others, maintaining a basically Scotistic position, argued that some other form besides the human soul is the form of the body. This “form of corporeity” organizes matter for the sake of being a human body but does not result in a full-fledged human being. Rather it makes a body with the potential for union with the human soul. The soul then actualizes this potential resulting in a complete human being. If Descartes did hold a fundamentally scholastic theory of mind-body union, then is it more Thomistic or Scotistic? Since intellect and will are the only faculties of the mind, it does not have the faculty for organizing matter for being a human body. So, if Descartes’ theory is scholastic, it must be most in line with some version of the Scotistic theory. Rozemond argues that Descartes’ rejection of all other substantial forms (except the human mind or soul) precludes this kind of theory since he cannot appeal to the doctrine of substantial forms like the Scotists.

Although Descartes argues that bodies, in the general sense, are constituted by extension, he also maintains that species of bodies are determined by the configuration and motion of their parts. This doctrine of “configuration and motion of parts” serves the same purpose as the doctrine of substantial forms with regards to entirely physical things. But the main difference between the two is that Descartes’ doctrine does not employ final causes. Recall that substantial forms organize matter for the purpose of being a species of thing. The purpose of a human body endowed with only the form of corporeity is union with the soul. Hence, the organization of matter into a human body is an effect that is explained by the final cause or purpose of being disposed for union. But, on Descartes’ account, the explanatory order would be reversed: a human body’s disposition for union is an effect resulting from the configuration and motion of parts. So, even though Descartes does not have recourse to substantial forms, he still has recourse to the configuration of matter and to the dispositions to which it gives rise, including “all the dispositions required to preserve that union” (AT IV 166: CSMK 243). Hence, on this account, Descartes gets what he needs, namely, Descartes gets a body properly configured for potential union with the mind, but without recourse to the scholastic notion of substantial forms with their final causal component.

Another feature of this basically Scotistic position is that the soul and the body were considered incomplete substances themselves, while their union results in one, complete substance. Surely Descartes maintains that mind and body are two substances but in what sense, if any, can they be considered incomplete? Descartes answers this question in the Fourth Replies. He argues that a substance may be complete insofar as it is a substance but incomplete insofar as it is referred to some other substance together with which it forms yet some third substance. This can be applied to mind and body as follows: the mind insofar as it is a thinking thing is a complete substance, while the body insofar as it is an extended thing is a complete substance, but each taken individually is only an incomplete human being.

This account is repeated in the following excerpt from a letter to Regius dated December 1641:

For there you said that the body and the soul, in relation to the whole human being, are incomplete substances; and it follows from their being incomplete that what they constitute is a being through itself (that is, an ens per se; AT III 460: CSMK 200).

The technical sense of the term “being through itself” was intended to capture the fact that human beings do not require any other creature but only God’s concurrence to exist. Accordingly, a being through itself, or ens per se, is a substance. Also notice that the claim in the letter to Regius that two incomplete substances together constitute a being through itself is reminiscent of Descartes’ remarks in the Fourth Replies. This affinity between the two texts indicates that the union of mind and body results in one complete substance or being through itself. This just means that mind and body are the metaphysical parts (mind and body are incomplete substances in this respect) that constitute one, whole human being, which is a complete substance in its own right. Hence, a human being is not the result of two substances causally interacting by means of contact and motion, as Gassendi and Elizabeth supposed, but rather they bear a relation of act and potency that results in one, whole and complete substantial human being.

This sheds some light on why Descartes thought that an account of mind-body union would put Gassendi’s and Elizabeth’s concerns to rest: they misconceived the union of mind and body as a mechanical relation when in fact it is a relation of act and potency. This avoids Gassendi’s and Elizabeth’s version of this problem. This aversion is accomplished by the fact that modes of voluntary motion (and sensations, by extrapolation) should be ascribed to a whole human being and not to the mind or the body taken individually. This is made apparent in a 21 May 1643 letter to Elizabeth where Descartes distinguishes between various “primitive notions.” The most general are the notions of being, number, duration, and so on, which apply to all conceivable things. He then goes on to distinguish the notions of mind and body:

Then, as regards body in particular, we have only the notion of extension, which entails the notions of shape and motion; and as regards the soul on its own, we have only the notion of thought, which includes the perceptions of the intellect and the inclinations of the will (AT III 665: CSMK 218).

Here body and soul (or mind) are primitive notions and the notions of their respective modes are the notions “entailed by” or “included in” these primitives. Descartes then discusses the primitive notion of mind-body union:

Lastly, as regards the soul and the body together, we have only the notion of their union, on which depends our notion of the soul’s power to move the body, and the body’s power to act on the soul and cause its sensations and passions (AT III 665: CSMK 218).

In light of the immediately preceding lines, this indicates that voluntary bodily movements and sensations are not modes of the body alone, or the mind alone, but rather are modes of “the soul and the body together.” This is at least partially confirmed in the following lines from Principles, part I, article 48:

But we also experience within ourselves certain other things, which must not be referred either to the mind alone or to the body alone. These arises, as will be made clear in the appropriate place, from the close and intimate union of our mind with the body. This list includes, first, appetites like hunger and thirds; secondly, the emotions or passions . . . (AT VIIIA 23: CSM I 209).

These texts indicate that the mind or soul is united with the body so as to give rise to another whole complete substance composed of these two metaphysical parts. And, moreover, this composite substance now has the capacity for having modes of its own, namely, modes of voluntary bodily movement and sensation, which neither the mind nor the body can have individually. So, voluntary bodily movements are not modes of the body alone caused by the mind, nor are sensations modes of the mind alone caused by the body. Rather, both are modes of a whole and complete human being. On this account, it makes no sense to ask how the non-extended mind can come into contact with the body to cause these modes. To ask this would be to get off on the wrong foot entirely, since contact between these two completely diverse substances is not required for these modes to exist. Rather all that is necessary is for the mind to actualize the potential in a properly disposed human body to form one, whole, human being to whom is attributed modes of voluntary movement and sensation.

Although the scholastic-Aristotelian interpretation avoids the traditional causal interaction problem based on the requirements of contact and motion, it does run up against another version of that problem, namely, a problem of formal causation. This is a problem facing any scholastic-Aristotelian theory of mind or soul-body union where the soul is understood to be an immaterial substantial form. Recall that the immaterial mind or soul as substantial form is suppose to act on a properly disposed human body in order to result in a full-fledged human being. The problem of formal causal interaction is: how can an immaterial soul assubstantial form act on the potential in a material thing? Can any sense be made of the claim that a non-extended or immaterial things acts on anything? Descartes noticed in a letter to Regius (AT III 493: CSMK 206) that the scholastics did not try to answer this question and so he and Regius need not either. The likely explanation of their silence is that the act-potency relation was considered absolutely fundamental to scholastic-Aristotelian philosophy and, therefore, it required no further explanation. So, in the end, even if Descartes’ theory is as described here, it does not evade all the causal problems associated with uniting immaterial souls or mind to their respective bodies. , However, if this proposed account is true, it helps to cast Descartes’ philosophy in a new light and to redirect the attention of scholars to the formal causal problems involved.

6. References and Further Reading

Primary Sources

  • Descartes, Rene, Ouevres de Descartes, 11 vols., eds. Charles Adam and Paul Tannery, Paris: Vrin, 1974-1989.
    • This is still the standard edition of all of Descartes’ works and correspondence in their original languages. Cited in the text as AT, volume, page.
  • Descartes, Rene, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 vols., trans. John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch and Anthony Kenny, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984-1991
    • This is the standard English translation of Descartes philosophical works and correspondence. Cited in the text as CSM or CSMK, volume, page.

Secondary Sources

  • Broughton, Janet and Mattern, Ruth, “Reinterpreting Descartes on the Notion of the Union of Mind and Body,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 16 (1978), 23-32.
    • A reinterpretation of the notion of mind-body union in the correspondence with Elizabeth, which addresses Radner’s interpretation of it. See below.
  • Garber, Daniel, “Understanding Interaction: What Descartes Should Have Told Elizabeth,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, Supp. 21 (1983), 15-32.
    • Article addressing the issues of the primitive notions and how this theory should be used to explain mind-body causal interaction to Elizabeth.
  • Hoffman, Paul, “The Unity of Descartes’ Man,” The Philosophical Review 95 (1986), 339-369.
    • Article arguing that Descartes’ theory of mind-body union is more in line with scholastic-Aristotelian theories of soul-body union than previously supposed.
  • Kenny, Anthony, Descartes: A Study of His Philosophy, New York: Random House, 1968. See especially chapters 4 and 10.
    • These chapters provide classic interpretations of the real distinction between mind and body and the mind-body problem.
  • Mattern, Ruth, “Descartes’ Correspondence with Elizabeth Concerning both the Union and Distinction of Mind and Body” in Descartes: Critical and Interpretive Essays, ed. Michael Hooker, Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press, 1978, 212-222.
    • Short essay examining Descartes’ correspondence with Elizabeth on this issue and how it was supposed to direct her to a correct understanding of mind-body causal interaction.
  • Radner, Daisie, “Descartes’ Notion of the Union of Mind and Body,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 9 (1971), 159-170.
    • This is the first article in Anglo-American scholarship to address the issue of mind-body union. It addresses several texts, including the letter to Elizabeth enumerating the primitive notions.
  • Rozemond, Marleen, Descartes’s Dualism, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1998.
    • This book argues for a particular understanding of the real distinction between mind and body that would preclude Hoffman’s scholastic-Aristotelian account of their union.
  • Skirry, Justin, Descartes and the Metaphysics of Human Nature, London and New York: Thoemmes-Continuum Press, 2005.
    • This book takes issue with Rozemond’s account of the mind-body union through a close re-examination of fundamental features of Descartes’ metaphysics and by building on certain features of Hoffman’s account.
  • Voss, Stephen, “Descartes: The End of Anthropology” in Reason, Will and Sensation, ed. John Cottingham, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994.
    • This essay provides a close textual analysis of Descartes’ account of the union of mind and body on the supposition that he maintained a Platonic rather than scholastic-Aristotelian theory of mind-body union.
  • Williams, Bernard, Descartes: The Project of Pure Enquiry, Sussex: Harvester Press, 1978. See especially chapter 4.
    • This is another classic account of the mind-body relation in Descartes.
  • Wilson, Margaret, Descartes, London and Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1978.
    • Provides classic accounts of the real distinction argument and issues concerning mind-body causal interaction.

Author Information

Justin Skirry
U. S. A.

Free Will

Free Will

Most of us are certain that we have free will, though what exactly this amounts to is much less certain. According to David Hume, the question of the nature of free will is “the most contentious question of metaphysics.” If this is correct, then figuring out what free will is will be no small task indeed. Minimally, to say that an agent has free will is to say that the agent has the capacity to choose his or her course of action. But animals seem to satisfy this criterion, and we typically think that only persons, and not animals, have free will. Let us then understand free will as the capacity unique to persons that allows them to control their actions. It is controversial whether this minimal understanding of what it means to have a free will actually requires an agent to have a specific faculty of will, whether the term "free will" is simply shorthand for other features of persons, and whether there really is such a thing as free will at all.

This article considers why we should care about free will and how freedom of will relates to freedom of action. It canvasses a number of the dominant accounts of what the will is, and then explores the persistent question of the relationship between free will and causal determinism, articulating a number of different positions one might take on the issue. For example, does determinism imply that there is no free will, as the incompatibilists argue, or does it allow for free will, as the compatibilists argue? This article explores several influential arguments that have been given in favor of these two dominant positions on the relationship between free will and causal determinism. Finally, there is a brief examination of how free will relates to theological determinism and logical determinism.

Table of Contents

  1. Free Will, Free Action and Moral Responsibility
  2. Accounts of the Will
    1. Faculties Model of the Will
    2. Hierarchical Model of the Will
    3. Reasons-Responsive View of the Will
  3. Free Will and Determinism
    1. The Thesis of Causal Determinism
    2. Determinism, Science and "Near Determinism"
    3. Compatibilism, Incompatibilism, and Pessimism
  4. Arguments for Incompatibilism (or Arguments against Compatibilism)
    1. The Consequence Argument
    2. The Origination Argument
    3. The Relation between the Arguments
  5. Arguments for Compatibilism (or Arguments against Incompatibilism)
    1. Rejecting the Incompatibilist Arguments
    2. Frankfurt’s Argument against "the Ability to Do Otherwise"
    3. Strawson’s Reactive Attitudes
  6. Related Issues
    1. Theological Determinism
    2. Logical Determinism
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Free Will, Free Action and Moral Responsibility

Why should we even care whether or not agents have free will? Probably the best reason for caring is that free will is closely related to two other important philosophical issues: freedom of action and moral responsibility. However, despite the close connection between these concepts, it is important not to conflate them.

We most often think that an agent’s free actions are those actions that she does as a result of exercising her free will. Consider a woman, Allison, who is contemplating a paradigmatic free action, such as whether or not to walk her dog. Allison might say to herself, “I know I should walk the dog—he needs the exercise. And while I don’t really want to walk him since it is cold outside, I think overall the best decision to make is that I should take him for a walk.” Thus, we see that one reason we care about free will is that it seems necessary for free action—Allison must first decide, or choose, to walk the dog before she actually takes him outside for his walk. If we assume that human actions are those actions that result from the rational capacities of humans, we then see that the possibility of free action depends on the possibility of free will: to say that an agent acted freely is minimally to say that the agent was successful in carrying out a free volition or choice.

Various philosophers have offered just such an account of freedom. Thomas Hobbes suggested that freedom consists in there being no external impediments to an agent doing what he wants to do: “A free agent is he that can do as he will, and forbear as he will, and that liberty is the absence of external impediments.” In An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, David Hume thought that free will (or "liberty," to use his term) is simply the “power of acting or of not acting, according to the determination of the will: that is, if we choose to remain at rest, we may; if we choose to move, we also may.… This hypothetical liberty is universally allowed to belong to everyone who is not a prisoner and in chains.” This suggests that freedom is simply the ability to select a course of action, and an agent is free if he is not being prevented by some external obstacle from completing that course of action. Thus, Hobbes and Hume would hold that Allison is free to walk her dog so long as nothing prevents her from carrying out her decision to walk her dog, and she is free not to walk her dog so long as nothing would compel her to walk her dog if she would decide not to.

However, one might still believe this approach fails to make an important distinction between these two related, but conceptually distinct, kinds of freedom: freedom of will versus freedom of action. This distinction is motivated by the apparent fact that agents can possess free will without also having freedom of action. Suppose that before Allison made the choice to walk the dog, she was taking a nap. And while Allison slept, there was a blizzard that moved through the area. The wind has drifted the snow up against the front of her house so that it is impossible for Allison to get out her front door and walk her dog even if she wanted to. So here we have a case involving free will, because Allison has chosen to take the dog for a walk, but not involving free action, because Allison is not able to take her dog for a walk.

Whether or not one can have freedom of action without free will depends on one’s view of what free will is. Also, the truth of causal determinism would not entail that agents lack the freedom to do what they want to do. An agent could do what she wants to do, even if she is causally determined to do that action. Thus, both Hobbes and Hume are rightly characterized as compatibilists.

Even if there is a distinction between freedom of will and freedom of action, it appears that free will is necessary for the performance of free actions. If Allison is brainwashed during her nap to want to walk her dog, then even if no external impediment prevents her from carrying through with this decision, we would say that her taking the dog for a walk is not a free action. Presumably, the reason why it would not be a free action is because, in the case of brainwashing, Allison’s decision does not arise from her free will. Thus, it looks like free will might be a necessary condition for free action, even if the two are distinct. In what follows, the phrase "acting with free will" means engaging in an action as the result of the utilization of free will. Use of the phrase does not deny the distinction between free will and free action.

The second reason to care about free will is that it seems to be required for moral responsibility. While there are various accounts of what exactly moral responsibility is, it is widely agreed that moral responsibility is distinct from causal responsibility. Consider a falling branch that lands on a car, breaking its window. While the branch is causally responsible for the broken window, it is not morally responsible for it because branches are not moral agents. Depending on one’s account of causation, it also might be possible to be morally responsible for an event or state of affairs even if one is not causally responsible for that same event or state of affairs. For present purposes, let us simply say that an agent is morally responsible for an event or state of affairs only if she is the appropriate recipient of moral praise or moral blame for that event or state of affairs (an agent can thus be morally responsible even if no one, including herself, actually does blame or praise her for her actions). According to the dominant view of the relationship between free will and moral responsibility, if an agent does not have free will, then that agent is not morally responsible for her actions. For example, if Allison is coerced into doing a morally bad act, such as stealing a car, we shouldn’t hold her morally responsible for this action since it is not an action that she did of her own free will.

Some philosophers do not believe that free will is required for moral responsibility. According to John Martin Fischer, human agents do not have free will, but they are still morally responsible for their choices and actions. In a nutshell, Fischer thinks that the kind of control needed for moral responsibility is weaker than the kind of control needed for free will. Furthermore, he thinks that the truth of causal determinism would preclude the kind of control needed for free will, but that it wouldn’t preclude the kind of control needed for moral responsibility. See Fischer (1994). As this example shows, virtually every issue pertaining to free will is contested by various philosophers.

However, many think that the significance of free will is not limited to its necessity for free action and moral responsibility. Various philosophers suggest that free will is also a requirement for agency, rationality, the autonomy and dignity of persons, creativity, cooperation, and the value of friendship and love [see Anglin (1990), Kane (1998) and Ekstrom (1999)]. We thus see that free will is central to many philosophical issues.

2. Accounts of the Will

Nearly every major figure in the history of philosophy has had something or other to say about free will. The present section considers three of the most prominent theories of what the will is.

a. Faculties Model of the Will

The faculties model of the will has its origin in the writings of ancient philosophers such as Plato and Aristotle, and it was the dominant view of the will for much of medieval and modern philosophy [see Descartes (1998) and the discussion of Aquinas in Stump (2003)]. It still has numerous proponents in the contemporary literature. What is distinct about free agents, according to this model, is their possession of certain powers or capacities. All living things possess some capacities, such as the capacities for growth and reproduction. What is unique about free agents, however, is that they also possess the capacities for intellection and volition. Another way of saying this is that free agents alone have the faculties of intellect and will. It is in virtue of having these additional faculties, and the interaction between them, that agents have free will.

The intellect, or the rational faculty, is the power of cognition. As a result of its cognitions, the intellect presents various things to the will as good under some description. To return to the case of Allison contemplating walking her dog, Allison’s intellect might evaluate walking the dog as good for the health of the dog. Furthermore, all agents that have an intellect also have a will. The will, or the volitional faculty, is an appetite for the good; that is, it is naturally drawn to goodness. The will, therefore, cannot pursue an option that the intellect presents as good in no way. The will is also able to command the other faculties; the will can command the body to move or the intellect to consider something. In the case of Allison, the will could command the body to pick up the leash, attach it to the dog, and go outside for a walk. As Aquinas, a proponent of this view of the will, puts it: “Only an agent endowed with an intellect can act with a judgment which is free, in so far as it apprehends the common note of goodness; from which it can judge this or the other thing to be good. Consequently, wherever there is intellect, there is free will” (Summa Theologiae, q. 59 a. 3). Thus, through the interaction between the intellect and will, an agent has free will to pursue something that it perceives as good.

b. Hierarchical Model of the Will

A widely influential contemporary account of the will is Harry Frankfurt’s hierarchical view of the will [see Frankfurt (1971)]. This account is also sometimes called a "structuralist" or "mesh" account of the will, since a will is free if it has a certain internal structure or "mesh" among the various levels of desires and volitions. According to the hierarchical model, agents can have different kinds of desires. Some desires are desires to do a particular action; for example, Allison may desire to go jogging. Call these desires "1st order desires." But even if Allison doesn’t desire to go jogging, she may nevertheless desire to be the kind of person who desires to go jogging. In other words, she may desire to have a certain 1st order desire. Call desires of this sort "2nd order desires." If agents also have further desires to have particular 2nd order desires, one could construct a seemingly infinite hierarchy of desires.

Not all of an agent’s desires result in action. In fact, if one has conflicting desires, then it is impossible for an agent to satisfy all her desires. Suppose that Allison not only desires to run, but that she also desires to stay curled up in bed, where it is nice and warm. In such a case, Allison cannot fulfill both of her 1st order desires. If Allison decides to act on her desire to run, we say that her desire to run has moved her to action. An effective desire of this sort is called a volition; a volition is a desire that moves the agent all the way to action. Similarly, one can differentiate between a mere 2nd order desire (simply a desire to have a certain desire) and a 2nd order volition (a desire for a desire to become one’s will, or a desire for a desire to become a volition). According to the hierarchical view of the will, free will consists in having 2nd order volitions. In other words, an agent has a free will if she is able to have the sort of will that she wants to have. An agent acts on her own free will if her action is the result of a 1st order desire that she wants to become a 1st order volition.

Hierarchical views of the will are problematic, however, because it looks as if certain sorts of questionable manipulation can be compatible with this view’s account of free will. According to the view under consideration, Allison has free will with regard to going jogging if she has a 2nd order desire that her 1st order desire to go jogging will move her to go jogging. Nothing in this account, however, depends on how she got these desires. Even if she were manipulated, via brainwashing, for example, into having her 2nd order desire for her 1st order desire to go running become her will, Allison has the right "mesh" between her various orders of desires to qualify as having free will. This is an untoward consequence. While more robust hierarchical accounts of the will have the resources for explaining why Allison might not be free in this case, it is widely agreed that cases of manipulation and coercion are problematic for solely structural accounts of the will [see Ekstrom (1999), Fischer (1994), Kane, (2005), Pereboom (2001) and van Inwagen (1983)].

c. Reasons-Responsive View of the Will

A third treatment of free will takes as its starting point the claim that agency involves a sensitivity to certain reasons. An agent acts with free will if she is responsive to the appropriate rational considerations, and she does not act with a free will if she lacks such responsiveness. To see what such a view amounts to, consider again the case of Allison and her decision to walk her dog. A reasons-responsive view of the will says that Allison’s volition to walk her dog is free if, had she had certain reasons for not walking her dog, she would not have decided to walk her dog. Imagine what would have happened had Allison turned on the television after waking from her nap and learned of the blizzard before deciding to walk her dog. Had she known of the blizzard, she would have had a good reason for deciding not to walk her dog. Even if such reasons never occur to her (that is, if she doesn’t learn of the blizzard before her decision), her disposition to have such reasons influence her volitions shows that she is responsive to reasons. Thus, reasons-responsive views of the will are essentially dispositional in nature.

Coercion and manipulation undermine free will, on this view, in virtue of making agents not reasons-responsive. If Allison has been brainwashed to walk the dog at a certain time, then even if she were to turn on the news and sees that it is snowing, she would attempt to walk the dog despite having good reasons not to. Thus, manipulated agents are not reasons-responsive, and in virtue of this lack free will. [See Fischer and Ravizza (1998) for one of the primary reasons-responsive views of free will.]

3. Free Will and Determinism

a. The Thesis of Causal Determinism

Most contemporary scholarship on free will focuses on whether or not it is compatible with causal determinism. Causal determinism is sometimes also called "nomological determinism." It is important to keep causal determinism distinct from other sorts of determinism, such as logical determinism or theological determinism (to be discussed below). Causal determinism (hereafter, simply "determinism") is the thesis that the course of the future is entirely determined by the conjunction of the past and the laws of nature. Imagine a proposition that completely describes the way that the entire universe was at some point in the past, say 100 million years ago. Let us call this proposition "P." Also imagine a proposition that expresses the conjunction of all the laws of nature; call this proposition "L." Determinism then is the thesis that the conjunction of P and L entails a unique future. Given P and L, there is only one possible future, one possible way for things to end up. To make the same point using possible world semantics, determinism is the thesis that all the states of affairs that obtain at some time in the past, when conjoined with the laws of nature, entail which possible world is the actual world. Since a possible world includes those states of affairs that will obtain, the truth of determinism amounts to the thesis that the past and the laws of nature entail what states of affairs will obtain in the future, and that only those states of affairs entailed by the past and the laws will in fact obtain.

A system's being determined is different from its being predictable. It is possible for determinism to be true and for no one to be able to predict the future. The fact that no human agent knows or is able to know future truths has no bearing on whether there are future truths entailed by the conjunction of the past and the laws. However, there is a weaker connection between the thesis of determinism and the predictability of the future. If determinism were true, then a being with a complete knowledge of P and L and with sufficient intellective capacities should be able to infallibly predict the way that the future will turn out. However, given that we humans lack both the relevant knowledge and the intellective capacities required, the fact that we are not able to predict the future is not evidence for the falsity of determinism.

b. Determinism, Science and "Near Determinism"

Most philosophers agree that whether or not determinism is true is a contingent matter; that is, determinism is neither necessarily true nor necessarily false. If this is so, then whether or not determinism is true becomes an empirical matter, to be discovered by investigating the way the world is, not through philosophical argumentation. This is not to deny that the truth of determinism would have metaphysical implications. For one, the truth of determinism would entail that the laws of nature are not merely probabilistic—for if they were, then the conjunction of the past and the laws would not entail a unique future. Furthermore, as we shall see shortly, philosophers care very much about what implications the truth of determinism would have for free will. But the point to note is that if the truth of determinism is a contingent truth about the way the world actually is, then scientific investigation should give us insight into this matter. Let us say that a possible world is deterministic if causal determinism is true in that world. There are two ways that worlds could fail to be deterministic. As already noted, if the laws of nature in a given world were probabilistic, then such a world would not be deterministic. Secondly, if there are entities within a world that are not fully governed by the laws of nature, then even if those laws are themselves deterministic, that world would not be deterministic.

Some scientists suggest that certain parts of physics give us reason to doubt the truth of determinism. For example, the standard interpretation of Quantum Theory, the Copenhagen Interpretation, holds that the laws governing nature are indeterministic and probabilistic. According to this interpretation, whether or not a small particle such as a quark swerves in a particular direction at a particular time is described properly only by probabilistic equations. Although the equations may predict the likelihood that a quark swerves to the left at a certain time, whether or not it actually swerves is indeterministic or random.

There are also deterministic interpretations of Quantum Theory, such as the Many-Worlds Interpretation. Fortunately, the outcome of the debate regarding whether Quantum Theory is most properly interpreted deterministically or indeterminstically, can be largely avoided for our current purposes. Even if (systems of) micro-particles such as quarks are indeterministic, it might be that (systems involving) larger physical objects such as cars, dogs, and people are deterministic. It is possible that the only indeterminism is on the scale of micro-particles and that macro-objects themselves obey deterministic laws. If this is the case, then causal determinism as defined above is, strictly speaking, false, but it is "nearly" true. That is, we could replace determinism with "near determinism," the thesis that despite quantum indeterminacy, the behaviors of all large physical objects—including all our actions—obey deterministic laws [see Honderich (2002), particularly chapter 6].

What would be the implications of the truth of either determinism or near determinism? More specifically, what would be the implications for questions of free will? One way to think about the implications would be by asking the following the question: Could we still be free even if scientists were to discover that causal determinism (or near determinism) is true?

c. Compatibilism, Incompatibilism, and Pessimism

The question at the end of the preceding section (Could we have free will even if determinism is true?) is a helpful way to differentiate the main positions regarding free will. Compatibilists answer this question in the affirmative. They believe that agents could have free will even if causal determinism is true (or even if near determinism is true. In what follows, I will omit this qualification). In other words, the existence of free will in a possible world is compatible with that world being deterministic. For this reason, this position is known as "compatibilism," and its proponents are called "compatibilists." According to the compatibilist, it is possible for an agent to be determined in all her choices and actions and still make some of her choices freely.

According to "incompatibilists," the existence of free will is incompatible with the truth of determinism. If a given possible world is deterministic, then no agent in that world has free will for that very reason. Furthermore, if one assumes that having free will is a necessary condition for being morally responsible for one’s actions, then the incompatibility of free will and determinism would entail the incompatibility of moral responsibility and causal determinism.

There are at least two kinds of incompatibilists. Some incompatibilists think that determinism is true of the actual world, and thus no agent in the actual world possesses free will. Such incompatibilists are often called "hard determinists" [see Pereboom (2001) for a defense of hard determinism]. Other incompatibilists think that the actual world is not deterministic and that at least some of the agents in the actual world have free will. These incompatibilists are referred to as "libertarians" [see Kane (2005), particularly chapters 3 and 4]. However, these two positions are not exhaustive. It is possible that one is an incompatibilist, thinks that the actual world is not deterministic, and yet still thinks that agents in the actual world do not have free will. While it is less clear what to call such a position (perhaps "free will deniers"), it illustrates that hard determinism and libertarianism do not exhaust the ways to be an incompatibilist. Since all incompatibilists, whatever their stripe, agree that the falsity of determinism is a necessary condition for free will, and since compatibilists deny this assertion, the following sections speak simply of incompatibilists and compatibilists.

It is also important to keep in mind that both compatibilism and incompatibilism are claims about possibility. According to the compatibilist, it is possible that an agent is both fully determined and yet free. The incompatibilist, on the other hand, maintains that such a state of affairs is impossible. But neither position by itself is making a claim about whether or not agents actually do possess free will. Assume for the moment that incompatibilism is true. If the truth of determinism is a contingent matter, then whether or not agents are morally responsible will depend on whether or not the actual world is deterministic. Furthermore, even if the actual world is indeterministic, it doesn’t immediately follow that the indeterminism present is of the sort required for free will (we will return to a similar point below when considering an objection to incompatibilism). Likewise, assume both that compatibilism is true and that causal determinism is true in the actual world. It does not follow from this that agents in the actual world actually possess free will.

Finally, there are free will pessimists [see Broad (1952) and G. Strawson (1994)]. Pessimists agree with the incompatibilists that free will is not possible if determinism is true. However, unlike the incompatibilists, pessimists do not think that indeterminism helps. In fact, they claim, rather than helping support free will, indeterminism undermines it. Consider Allison contemplating taking her dog for a walk. According to the pessimist, if Allison is determined, she cannot be free. But if determinism is false, then there will be indeterminacy at some point prior to her action. Exactly where one locates this indeterminacy will depend on one’s particular view of the nature of free will. Let us assume that that indeterminacy is located in which reasons occur to Allison. It is hard to see, the pessimist argues, how this indeterminacy could enhance Allison’s free will, for the occurrence of her reasons is indeterministic, then having those reasons is not within Allison’s control. But if Allison decides on the basis of whatever reasons she does have, then her volition is based upon something outside of her control. It is based instead on chance. Thus, pessimists think that the addition of indeterminism actually makes agents lack the kind of control needed for free will. While pessimism might seem to be the same position as that advocated by free will deniers, pessimism is a stronger claim. Free will deniers thinks that while free will is possible, it just isn’t actual: agents in fact don’t have free will. Pessimists, however, have a stronger position, thinking that free will is impossible. Not only do agents lack free will, there is no way that they could have it [see G. Strawson (1994)]. The only way to preserve moral responsibility, for the pessimist, is thus to deny that free will is a necessary condition for moral responsibility.

As pessimism shows us, even a resolution to the debate between compatibilists and incompatibilists will not by itself solve the debate about whether or not we actually have free will. Nevertheless, it is to this debate that we now turn.

4. Arguments for Incompatibilism (or Arguments against Compatibilism)

Incompatibilists say that free will is incompatible with the truth of determinism. Not all arguments for incompatibilism can be considered here; let us focus on two major varieties. The first variety is built around the idea that having free will is a matter of having a choice about certain of our actions, and that having a choice is a matter of having genuine options or alternatives about what one does. The second variety of arguments is built around the idea that the truth of determinism would mean that we don’t cause our actions in the right kind of way. The truth of determinism would mean that we don’t originate our actions in a significant way and our actions are not ultimately controlled by us. In other words, we lack the ability for self-determination. Let us consider a representative argument from each set.

a. The Consequence Argument

The most well-known and influential argument for incompatibilism from the first set of arguments is called the "Consequence Argument," and it has been championed by Carl Ginet and Peter van Inwagen [see Ginet (1966) and van Inwagen (1983)]. The Consequence Argument is based on a fundamental distinction between the past and the future. First, consider an informal presentation of this argument. There seems to be a profound asymmetry between the past and the future based on the direction of the flow of time and the normal direction of causation. The future is open in a way that the past is not. It looks as though there is nothing that Allison can now do about the fact that Booth killed Lincoln, given that Lincoln was assassinated by Booth in 1865.

This point stands even if we admit the possibility of time travel. For if time travel is possible, Allison can influence what the past became, but she cannot literally change the past. Consider the following argument:

  1. The proposition "Lincoln was assassinated in 1865" is true.
  2. If Allison travels to the past, she could prevent Lincoln from being assassinated in 1865 (temporarily assumed for reductio purposes).
  3. If Allison were to travel to the past and prevent Lincoln from being assassinated in 1865, the proposition "Lincoln was assassinated in 1865" would be false.
  4. A proposition cannot both be true and false.
  5. Therefore, 2 is false.

So, at most the possibility of time travel allows for agents to have causal impact on the past, not for agents to change what has already become the past. The past thus appears to be fixed and unalterable. However, it seems that the same is not true of the future, for Allison can have an influence on the future through her volitions and subsequent actions. For example, if she were to invent a time machine, then she could, at some point in the future, get in her time machine and travel to the past and try to prevent Lincoln from being assassinated. However, given that he was assassinated, we can infer that her attempts would all fail. On the other hand, she could refrain from using her time machine in this way.

The asymmetry between past and future is illustrated by the fact that we don’t deliberate about the past in the same way that we deliberate about the future. While Allison might deliberate about whether a past action was really the best action that she could have done, she deliberates about the future in a different way. Allison can question whether her past actions were in fact the best, but she can both question what future acts would be best as well as which future acts she should perform. Thus, it looks like the future is open to Allison, or up to her, in a way that the past is not. In other words, when an agent like Allison is using her free will, what she is doing is selecting from a range of different options for the future, each of which is possible given the past and the laws of nature. For this reason, this view of free will is often called the "Garden of Forking Paths Model."

The Consequence Argument builds upon this view of the fixed nature of the past to argue that if determinism is true, the future is not open in the way that the above reflections suggest. For if determinism is true, the future is as fixed as is the past. Remember from the above definition that determinism is the thesis the past (P) and the laws of nature (L) entail a unique future. Let "F" refer to any true proposition about the future. The Consequence argument depends on two modal operators, and two inference rules. Let the modal operator "☐" abbreviate "It is logically necessary that..," so that, when it operates on some proposition p, "☐p" abbreviates "It is logically necessary that p." Let the modal operator "N" be such that "Np" stands for "p is true and no one has, or ever had, any choice about whether p was true." Call the following two inference rules "Alpha" and "Beta:"

Alpha: ☐p implies Np

Beta: {Np and N(pq)} implies Nq

According to Alpha, if p is a necessary truth, then no one has, or ever had, any choice about whether p was true. Similarly, according to Beta, if no one has, or ever had, any choice about p being true, and no one has, or ever had, any choice that p entails q, then no one has, or ever had, any choice about whether q is true. To see the plausibility of Beta, consider the following application. Let p be the proposition "The earth was struck by a meteor weighing 100 metric tons one billion years ago," and let q be the proposition "If the earth was struck by a meteor weighing 100 metric tons one billion years ago, then thousands of species went extinct." Since I have no choice about such a meteor hitting in the past, and have no choice that if such meteor hits, it will cause thousands of species to go extinct, I have no choice that thousands of species went extinct. Beta thus looks extremely plausible. But if Beta is true, then we can construct an argument to show that if determinism is true, then I have no choice about anything, including my supposed free actions in the future. The argument begins with the definition of determinism given above:

(1) ☐{(P and L) → F}

Using a valid logical rule of inference (exportation), we can transform 1 into 2:

(2) ☐{P → (LF)}

Applying Alpha, we can derive 3:

(3) N{P → (LF)}

The second premise in the Consequence Argument is called the "fixity of the past." No one has, or ever had, a choice about the true description P of the universe at some point in the distant past:

(4) NP

From 3, 4 and Beta, we can deduce 5:

(5) N(LF)

The final premise in the argument is the fixity of the laws of nature. No one has, or ever had, a choice about what the laws of nature are (try as I might, I cannot make the law of universal gravitation not be a law of nature):

(6) NL

And from 5 and 6, again using Beta, we can infer that no one has, or ever had, a choice about F:

(7) NF

Given that F was any true proposition about the future, the Consequence Argument concludes that if determinism is true, then no one has or ever had a choice about any aspect of the future, including what we normally take to be our free actions. Thus, if determinism is true, we do not have free will.

b. The Origination Argument

The second general set of arguments for the incompatibility of free will and determinism builds on the importance of the source of a volition for free will. Again, it will be helpful to begin with an informal presentation of the argument before considering a formal presentation of it. According to this line of thought, an agent has free will when her volitions issue from the agent herself in a particular sort of way (say, her beliefs and desires). What is important for free will, proponents of this argument claim, is not simply that the causal chain for an agent’s volition goes through the agent, but that it originates with the agent. In other words, an agent acts with free will only if she originates her action, or if she is the ultimate source or first cause of her action [see Kane (1998)].

Consider again the claim that free will is a necessary condition for moral responsibility. What reflection on cases of coercion and manipulation suggests to us is that even if a coerced or manipulated agent is acting on her beliefs and desires, this isn’t enough for moral responsibility. We normally assume that coercion and certain forms of manipulation undercut an agent’s moral responsibility precisely because a coerced or manipulated agent isn’t the originator of her coerced action. If Allison is coerced into walking her dog via brainwashing, then her walking of the dog originates in the brainwashing, and not in Allison herself. Consider, then, the similarities between cases of coercion and manipulation, on the one hand, and the implications of the truth of determinism on the other. If determinism were true, it might be true that Allison chooses to walk her dog because of her beliefs and desires, but those beliefs and desires would themselves be the inevitable products of causal chains that began millions of years ago. Thus, a determined agent is at most a source, but not the ultimate source, of her volitions. According to proponents of this sort of argument for incompatibilism, the truth of determinism would mean that agents don’t cause their actions in the kind of way needed for free will and, ultimately, moral responsibility.

We can represent a formal version of the argument, called the "Origination Argument," as follows:

  1. An agent acts with free will only if she is the originator (or ultimate source) of her actions.
  2. If determinism is true, then everything any agent does is ultimately caused by events and circumstances outside her control.
  3. If everything an agent does is ultimately caused by events and circumstances beyond her control, then the agent is not the originator (or ultimate source) of her actions.
  4. Therefore, if determinism is true, then no agent is the originator (or ultimate source) of her actions.
  5. Therefore, if determinism is true, no agent has free will.

The Origination Argument is valid. So, in evaluating its soundness, we must evaluate the truth of its three premises. Premise 3 is clearly true, since for an agent to be an originator just is for that agent not to be ultimately determined by anything outside of herself. Premise 2 of this argument is true by the definition of determinism. To reject the conclusion of the argument, one must therefore reject premise 1.

Earlier we briefly noted one account of free will which implicitly denies premise 1, namely the hierarchical model of free will. According to this model, an agent acts with free will so long as the causal chain for that action goes through the agent’s 1st- and 2nd-order desires. One way of emphasizing the need for origination over-against such a hierarchical model is to embrace agent-causation. If premise 1 is true, then the agent’s volition cannot be the product of a deterministic causal chain extended beyond the agent. What other options are there? Two options are that volitions are uncaused, or only caused indeterministically. It is difficult to see how an agent could be the originator or ultimate source of volitions if volitions are uncaused. Similarly, for reasons we saw above when discussing the free will pessimist, it looks as if indeterministic causation would undermine, rather than enhance, an agent’s control over her volitions. For these reasons, some incompatibilists favor looking at the causation involved in volitions in a new light. Instead of holding that a volition is caused by a previous event (either deterministically or indeterministically), these incompatibilists favor saying that volitions are caused directly by agents. [For an extended defense of this view, see O’Connor, (2000).] They hold that there are two irreducibly different kinds of causation, event-causation and agent-causation, and the latter is involved in free will. Proponents of agent-causation propose that agents are enduring substances that directly possess the power to cause volitions. Although many philosophers question whether agent-causation is coherent, if it were coherent, then it would provide support for premise 1 of the Origination Argument.

c. The Relation between the Arguments

The above way of delineating the Consequence and Origination Arguments may unfortunately suggest that the two kinds of arguments are more independent from each other than they really are. A number of incompatibilists have argued that agents originate their actions in the way required by premise 1 of the Origination Argument if and only if they have a choice about their actions in the way suggested by the Consequence Argument. In other words, if my future volitions are not the sort of thing that I have a choice about, then I do not originate those volitions. And as the above arguments contend, the truth of causal determinism threatens both our control over our actions and volitions, and our ability to originate those same actions and volitions. For if causal determinism is true, then the distant past, when joined with the laws of nature, is sufficient for every volition that an agent makes, and the causal chains that lead to those volitions would not begin within the agent. Thus, most incompatibilists think that having a choice and being a self-determiner go hand-in-hand. Robert Kane, for instance, argues that if agents have "ultimate responsibility" (his term for what is here called "origination" or "self-determination"), then they will also have alternative possibilities open to them. According to this line of argumentation, the power to cause one’s own actions is not a distinct power from the power to choose and do otherwise. Thus, the two different kinds of arguments for incompatibilism may simply be two sides of the same coin [see Kane (1996) and (2005)].

5. Arguments for Compatibilism (or Arguments against Incompatibilism)

Having laid out representatives of the two most prominent arguments for incompatibilism, let's consider arguments in favor of compatibilism. In considering these kinds of arguments, it is pedagogically useful to approach them by using the arguments for incompatibilism. So, this section begins by considering ways that compatibilists have responded to the arguments given in the preceding section.

a. Rejecting the Incompatibilist Arguments

As noted above, the Origination Argument for incompatibilism is valid, and two of its premises are above dispute. Thus, the only way for the compatibilist to reject the conclusion of the Origination Argument is to reject its first premise. In other words, given the definition of determinism, compatibilists must reject that free will requires an agent being the originator or ultimate source of her actions. But how might this be done? Most frequently, compatibilists motivate a rejection of the "ultimacy condition" of free will by appealing to either a hierarchical or reasons-responsive view of what the will is [see Frankfurt, (1971) and Fischer and Ravizza, (1998)]. If all that is required for free will, for example, is that a certain mesh between an agent’s 1st-order volitions and 2nd-order desires, then such an account does not require that an agent be the originator of those desires. Furthermore, since the truth of determinism would not entail that agents don’t have 1st and 2nd-order desires and volitions, a hierarchical account of the will is compatible with the truth of determinism. Similarly, if an agent has free will if she has the requisite level of reasons-responsiveness such that she would have willed differently had she had different reasons, ultimacy is again not required. Thus, if one adopts certain accounts of the will, one has reason for rejecting the central premise of the Origination Argument.

Compatibilists have a greater number of responses available to them with regard to the Consequence Argument. One way of understanding the N operator that figures in the Consequence Argument is in terms of having the ability to do otherwise. That is, to say that Allison has no choice about a particular action of hers is to say that she could not have performed a different action (or even no action at all). Incompatibilists can easily account for this ability to do otherwise. According to incompatibilists, an agent can be free only if determinism is false. Consider again the case of Allison. If determinism is false, even though Allison did choose to walk her dog, she could have done otherwise than walk her dog since the conjunction of P and L is not sufficient for her taking her dog for a walk. Compatibilists, however, can give their own account of the ability to do otherwise. For them, to say that Allison could have done otherwise is simply to say that Allison would have done otherwise had she willed or chosen to do so [see, for example, Chisholm (1967)]. Of course, if determinism is true, then the only way that Allison could have willed or chosen to do otherwise would be if either the past or the laws were different than they actually are. In other words, saying that an agent could have done otherwise is to say that the agent would have done otherwise in a different counterfactual condition. But saying this is entirely consistent with one way of understanding the ability to do otherwise. Thus, these compatibilists are saying that Allison has the ability to do something such that, had she done it, either the past or the laws of nature would have been different than they actually are. If P and L entail that the agent does some action A, then the agent’s doing otherwise than A entails that either P or L would have been different than they actually are. Some compatibilists favor saying that agents have this counterfactual power over the past, while others favor counterfactual power over the laws of nature [Compare Lewis (1981) and Fischer (1984)]. Regardless, adopting either strategy provides the compatibilist with a way of avoiding the conclusion of the Consequence Argument by denying either premise 4 or premise 6 of that argument. Furthermore, having such a power is not a hollow victory, for it demarcates a plausible difference between those actions an agent would have done even if she didn’t want to (as in the case of coercion or manipulation) from those actions that an agent only would have done had she had certain beliefs and desires about that action. This view thus differentiates between those actions that were within the agent’s power to bring about from those that were not.

A second compatibilist response to the Consequence Argument is to deny the validity of the inference rule Beta the argument uses. While there are several approaches to this, perhaps the most decisive is the following, called the principle of Agglomeration [see McKay and Johnson (1996)]. Using only the inference rules Alpha, Beta and the basic rule of logical replacement, one can show that

(1) Np


(2) Nq

would entail

(3) N(p and q)

if Beta were valid. 1 and 2 do not entail 3, so Beta must be invalid.

To see why 3 does not follow from 1 and 2, consider the case of a coin-toss. If the coin-toss is truly random, then Allison has no choice regarding whether the coin (if flipped) lands heads. Similarly, she has no choice regarding whether the coin (again, if flipped) lands tails. For purposes of simplicity, let us stipulate that the coin cannot land on its side and, if flipped, must land either heads or tails. Let p above represent ‘the coin doesn’t land heads’ and q represent ‘the coin doesn’t land tails’. If Beta were valid, then 1 and 2 would entail 3, and Allison would not have a choice about the conjunction of p and q; that is, she wouldn’t have a choice about the coin not landing heads and the coin not landing tails. If Allison didn’t have a choice about the coin not landing heads and didn’t have a choice about the coin not landing tails, then she wouldn’t have a choice about the coin landing either heads or tails. But Allison does have a choice about this—after all, she can ensure that the coin lands either heads or tails by simply flipping the coin. So Allison does have a choice about the conjunction of p and q. Since Alpha and the relevant rules of logical replacement in the transformation from Np and Nq to N(p and q) are beyond dispute, Beta must be invalid. Thus, the Consequent Argument for incompatibilism is invalid. [For an incompatibilist reply to the argument from Agglomeration, see Finch and Warfield (1998).]

b. Frankfurt’s Argument against "the Ability to Do Otherwise"

Two other arguments for compatibilism build on the freedom requirement for moral responsibility. If one can show that moral responsibility is compatible with the truth of determinism, and if free will is required for moral responsibility, one will have implicitly shown that free will is itself compatible with the truth of determinism. The first of these arguments for compatibilism rejects the understanding of having a choice as involving the ability to do otherwise mentioned above. While most philosophers have tended to accept that an agent can be morally responsible for doing an action only if she could have done otherwise, Harry Frankfurt has attempted to show that this requirement is in fact false. Frankfurt gives an example in which an agent does an action in circumstances that lead us to believe that the agent acted freely [Frankfurt (1969); for recent discussion, see Widerker and McKenna (2003)]. Yet, unbeknown to the agent, the circumstances include some mechanism that would bring about the action if the agent did not perform it on her own. As it happens, though, the agent does perform the action freely and the mechanism is not involved in bringing about the action. It thus looks like the agent is morally responsible despite not being able to do otherwise. Here is one such scenario:

Allison is contemplating whether to walk her dog or not. Unbeknown to Allison, her father, Lloyd, wants to insure that that she does decide to walk the dog. He has therefore implanted a computer chip in her head such that if she is about to decide not to walk the dog, the chip will activate and coerce her into deciding to take the dog for a walk. Given the presence of the chip, Allison is unable not to decide to walk her dog, and she lacks the ability to do otherwise. However, Allison does decide to walk the dog on her own.

In such a case, Frankfurt thinks that Allison is morally responsible for her decision since the presence of Lloyd and his computer chip play no causal role in her decision. Since she would have been morally responsible had Lloyd not been prepared to ensure that she decide to take her dog for a walk, why think that his mere presence renders her not morally responsible? Frankfurt concludes that Allison is morally responsible despite lacking the ability to do otherwise. If Frankfurt is right that such cases are possible, then even if the truth of determinism is incompatible with a kind of freedom that requires the ability to do otherwise, it is compatible with the kind of freedom required for moral responsibility.

c. Strawson’s Reactive Attitudes

In an influential article, Peter Strawson argues that many of the traditional debates between compatibilists and incompatibilists (such as how to understand the ability to do otherwise) are misguided [P. Strawson (1963)]. Strawson thinks that we should instead focus on what he calls the reactive attitudes—those attitudes we have toward other people based on their attitudes toward and treatment of us. Strawson says that the hallmark of reactive attitudes is that they are “essentially natural human reactions to the good or ill will or indifference of others toward us, as displayed in their attitudes and actions.” Examples of reactive attitudes include gratitude, resentment, forgiveness and love. Strawson thinks that these attitudes are crucial to the interpersonal interactions and that they provide the basis for holding individuals morally responsible. Strawson then argues for two claims. The first of these is that an agent’s reactive attitudes would not be affected by a belief that determinism was true:

The human commitment to participation in ordinary interpersonal relationships is, I think, too thoroughgoing and deeply rooted for us to take seriously the thought that a general theoretical conviction might so change our world that, in it, there were no longer such things as inter-personal relationships as we normally understand them.… A sustained objectivity of inter-personal attitude, and the human isolation which that would entail, does not seem to be something of which human beings would be capable, even if some general truth were a theoretical ground for it.

Furthermore, Strawson also argues for a normative claim: the truth of determinism should not undermine our reactive attitudes. He thinks that there are two kinds of cases where it is appropriate to suspend our reactive attitudes. One involves agents, such as young children or the mentally disabled, who are not moral agents. Strawson thinks that we should not have reactive attitudes toward non-moral agents. The second kind of case where it is appropriate to suspend our reactive attitudes are those in which while the agent is a moral agent, her action toward us is not connected to her agency in the correct way. For instance, while I might have the reactive attitude of resentment towards someone who bumps into me and makes me spill my drink, if I were to find out that the person was pushed into me, I would not be justified in resenting that individual. The truth of determinism, however, would neither entail that no agents are moral agents nor that none of an agent’s actions are connected to her moral agency. Thus, Strawson thinks, the truth of determinism should not undermine our reactive attitudes. Since moral responsibility is based on the reactive attitudes, Strawson thinks that moral responsibility is compatible with the truth of determinism. And if free will is a requirement for moral responsibility, Strawson’s argument gives support to compatibilism.

6. Related Issues

The above discussion should help explain the perennial attraction philosophers have to the issues surrounding free will, particularly as it relates to causal determinism. However, free will is also intimately related to a number of other recurrent issues in the history of philosophy. In this final section, I will briefly articulate two other kinds of determinism and show how they are connected to free will.

a. Theological Determinism

The debate about free will and causal determinism parallels, in many ways, another debate about free will, this one stemming from what is often called ‘theological determinism’. Some religious traditions hold that God is ultimately responsible for everything that happens. According to these traditions, God’s willing x is necessary and sufficient for x. But if He is ultimately responsible for everything in virtue of what He wills, then He is ultimately responsible for all the actions and volitions performed by agents. God’s willing that Allison take the dog for a walk is thus necessary and sufficient for Allison taking the dog for a walk. But if this is true, it is hard to see how Allison could have free will. The problem becomes especially astute when considering tradition doctrines of eternal punishment. The traditional Christian doctrine of Hell, for example, is that Hell is a place of eternal punishment for non-repentant sinners. But if theological determinism is true, then whether or not agents repent is ultimately up to God, not to the agents themselves. This worry over free will thus gives rise to a particular version of the problem of evil: why does God not will that all come to faith, when His having such a will is sufficient for their salvation? [For a discussion of these, and related issues, see Helm, (1994).]

b. Logical Determinism

In addition to the causal and theological forms of determinism, there is also logical determinism. Logical determinism builds off the law of excluded middle and holds that propositions about what agents will do in the future already have a truth value. For instance, the proposition "Allison will take the dog for a walk next Thursday" is already true or false. Assume that it is true. Since token propositions cannot change in truth value over time, it was true a million years ago that Allison would walk her dog next Thursday. But the truth of the relevant proposition is sufficient for her actually taking the dog for a walk (after all, if it is true that she will walk the dog, then she will walk the dog). But then it looks like no matter what happens, Allison will in fact take her dog for a walk next Thursday and that this has always been the case. However, it is hard to see how Allison’s deciding to walk the dog can be a free decision since she must (given that the relevant token proposition is true and was true a million years ago) decide to walk him. In response to this problem, some philosophers have attempted to show that free will is compatible with the existence of true propositions about what we will do in the future, and others have denied that propositions about future free actions have a truth value, that is, that the law of excluded middle fails for some propositions. [For an introduction to these issues, see Finch and Warfield, (1999) and Kane, (2002).] If God is a being who knows the truth value of every proposition, this debate also connects with the debate over the relationship between divine foreknowledge and free will.

From this brief survey, we see that free will touches on central issues in metaphysics, philosophy of human nature, action theory, ethics and the philosophy of religion. Furthermore, we’ve seen that there are competing views regarding virtually every aspect of free will (including whether there is, or even could be, such a thing). Perhaps this partially explains the perennial philosophical interest in the topic.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Anglin, W. S. (1990). Free Will and the Christian Faith (Clarendon Press).
  • Broad, C. D. (1952). “Determinism, Indeterminism, and Libertarianism,” in Ethics and the History of Philosophy (Routledge and Kegan Paul).
  • Chisholm, Roderick (1967). “He Could Have Done Otherwise,” Journal of Philosophy 64: 409-417.
  • Descartes, René (1998). Discourse on Method and Meditations on First Philosophy, 4th edition (Hackett Publishing Company).
  • Ekstrom, Laura Waddell (1999). Free Will: A Philosophical Study (HarperCollins Publishers).
  • Finch, Alicia and Ted Warfield (1994). “Fatalism: Logical and Theological,” Faith and Philosophy 16.2: 233-238.
  • Finch, Alicia and Ted Warfield (1998). “The Mind Argument and Libertarianism,” Mind 107: 515-528.
  • Fischer, John Martin (1984). “Power Over the Past,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 65: 335-350.
  • Fischer, John Martin (1994). The Metaphysics of Free Will (Blackwell).
  • Fischer, John Martin and Mark Ravizza (1998). Responsibility and Control: A Theory of Moral Responsibility (Cambridge University Press).
  • Frankfurt, Harry (1969). “Alternate Possibilities and Moral Responsibility,” reprinted in Pereboom, (1997), pages 156-166.
  • Frankfurt, Harry (1971). “Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person,” reprinted in Pereboom (1997), pages 167-183.
  • Ginet, Carl (1966). “Might We Have No Choice,” in Keith Lehrer, ed., Freedom and Determinism(Random House), pages 205-224.
  • Helm, Paul (1994). The Providence of God (InterVarsity Press).
  • Honderich, Ted (2002). How Free are You?, 2nd edition (Oxford University Press).
  • Kane, Robert (1998). The Significance of Free Will (Oxford University Press).
  • Kane, Robert, ed. (2001). Free Will (Blackwell).
  • Kane, Robert, ed. (2002). The Oxford Handbook of Free Will (Oxford University Press).
  • Kane, Robert (2005). A Contemporary Introduction to Free Will (Oxford University Press).
  • Lewis, David (1981). “Are We Free to Break the Laws?” Theoria 47: 113-121.
  • McKay, Thomas and David Johnson (1996). “A Reconsideration of an Argument against Compatibilism,” Philosophical Topics 24: 113-122.
  • O’Connor, Timothy (2000). Persons and Causes: The Metaphysics of Free Will (Oxford University Press).
  • Pereboom, Derk, ed. (1997). Free Will (Hackett).
  • Pereboom, Derk (2001). Living Without Free Will (Cambridge University Press).
  • Smilansky, Saul (2000). Free Will and Illusion (Clarendon Press).
  • Strawson, Galen (1994). “The Impossibility of Moral Responsibility,” Philosophical Studies 75: 5-24.
  • Strawson, Peter (1963). “Freedom and Resentment,” reprinted in Pereboom (1997), pages 119-142.
  • Stump, Eleonore (2003). Aquinas (Routledge).
  • Van Inwagen, Peter (1983). An Essay on Free Will (Clarendon Press).
  • Widerker, David and Michael McKenna (2003). Moral Responsibility and Alternative Possibilities: Essays on the Importance of Alternative Possibilities (Ashgate).

Author Information

Kevin Timpe
Northwest Nazarene University
U. S. A.

Davidson, Donald Herbert

Donald Herbert Davidson (1917—2003)

Donald Davidson was a 20th century American philosopher whose most profound influences on contemporary philosophy were in the philosophy of mind and action. This article examines in detail two leading motifs in Davidson's philosophy. One is that mental phenomena resist being "captured in the nomological net of physical theory." Davidson claims there are no strict deterministic laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained. He rejects all deterministic, non-normative laws connecting either mental states with physical states or mental states with other mental states. The other motif concerns the problem of analyzing the explanatory force of an agent's reasons for his or her actions. It is Davidson's contention that explanation by appeal to reasons is a form of causal explanation, because this is the only way to account for the fact that we have many reasons for acting the way we did, but only one of them is the reason we acted that way.

Davidson’s argument that mental phenomena can’t be captured by strict, deterministic scientific laws as they are normally understood depends upon his treatment of propositional attitudes, attitudes of hoping that p, or fearing that p, or believing that p, where p is some proposition. Propositional attitudes have certain features that distinguish them from physical states and events, says Davidson. For Davidson there is no "underlying mental reality whose laws we can study in abstraction from the normative and holistic perspectives of interpretation." His theory of propositional attitudes is guided by conclusions drawn from the project of Radical Interpretation, a project initiated by W.V.O. Quine, Davidson's teacher. Quine challenged two central tenets of Logical Positivism: reductionism and the analytic/synthetic distinction. Following in Quine’s footsteps, Davidson does away with what he considers to be the third and last dogma of empiricism: the dogma of the dualism of scheme and reality. See also the article Davidson's Philosophy of Language."

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Influences
  2. Anomalism of the Mental
  3. Causal Explanation of Action
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Influences

Donald Davidson was born on March 6, 1917 in Springfield, Massachusetts. He studied English, Comparative Literature and Classics in his undergraduate years at Harvard, and in his sophomore year he attended two classes that made a lasting impression on him. These were two philosophy classes taught by Alfred North Whitehead in the last year of his career. Afterwards, Davidson was accepted to graduate studies in philosophy at Harvard, where he studied under Willard Van Orman Quine. Quine set Davidson on a course in philosophy quite different from that of Whitehead. Subsequently, Davidson did his dissertation on Plato's Philebus.

According to Davidson, "The central thesis that emerged was that when Plato had reworked the theory of ideas as a consequence of the explorations and criticisms of the Parmenides, Sophist, Theaetetus, and Politicus, he realized that the theory could no longer be deployed as a main support of an ethical position, as it had been developed in the Republic and elsewhere." This dissertation reveals the development of Davidson's philosophical method and his epistemological position.

Davidson's most profound influences on contemporary philosophy stem from his philosophy of mind and action. However, Davidson's philosophical positions in action theory and philosophy of mind are intrinsically tied into his work on the semantics of natural languages.

Davidson's apprenticeship in philosophy took place in an intellectual milieu very different from today’s. In the Anglo-American philosophical community, the middle of the century was dominated by Logical Positivism. Davidson recalls that he got through graduate school at Harvard by reading an anthology of Logical Positivism by Feigl and Sellars. Logical positivism emerged in the Austro-Hungarian Empire early in this century. Influenced by the logicist project of Bertrand Russell and Gottlob Frege on the one hand, and by advances in science on the other, the Logical Positivists of the Vienna Circle turned to physics as a model of theoretical discourse; and they considered sensory experiences to be fundamental. Although Logical Positivism was not entirely a unified movement, the Verification Principle was shared by most of them. It states that the meaning of sentences can be accounted for in terms of experiences that would verify them. Logical Positivism usually promotes a reductionist program: the reduction of all special sciences to physics, and of all meaningful statements to reports about sensory experiences. In his famous paper, Two Dogmas of Empiricism, Davidson's teacher Quine challenged two central tenets of Logical Positivism: reductionism and the analytic/synthetic distinction. Following in Quine’s footsteps, Davidson does away with what he considers to be the third and last dogma of empiricism: the dogma of the dualism of scheme and reality. See his paper "On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme."

Of the two leading motifs in Davidson's mature philosophy discussed in this article, one has to do with the fact that mental phenomena resist being "captured in the nomological net of physical theory." Davidson rejects strict psychophysical and psychological laws. The other motif concerns the problem of analyzing the explanatory force of an agent's reasons for his or her actions. It is Davidson's contention that explanation by appeal to reasons is a form of causal explanation.

2. Anomalism of the Mental

Simply put, "anomalism of the mental" amounts to the claim that the mental is not governed by laws as we usually understand them. In Davidson's own words:

There are no strict deterministic laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained.

In developing his position, Davidson attempts to retain his materialism while at the same time to avoid a reductionism. Usually reductionism has been held to have followed from materialism. When Davidson asserts that there can be no laws on the basis of which mental events can be predicted and explained, he has two different types of laws in mind. In the first type of law, an attempt is made to link mental states and events with physical states and events, and the law is used to explain the former on the basis of the latter. Davidson spends much of his effort in Mental Events showing the impossibility of such psychophysical laws. In the second type of law, there is an attempt to formulate strict deterministic laws linking mental states and events to other mental states and events. Davidson denies the possibility of these psychological laws as well. Davidson's latter claim is considered to be a rejection of the most basic goal of the science of psychology.

In arguing against the possibility of psychophysical laws, Davidson has in mind the following kinds of laws:

(BL) ∀x (x is in M iff x is in P)

where M denotes some mental state or event and P denotes some physical state or event and "iff" abbreviates "if and only if." The laws of the above kind are known as bridging laws (BL). A stronger version of a bridging law claims identity of properties from different theoretical discourses. A weaker version claims only that whenever an object instantiates one property it instantiates the other. An important distinction between laws and generalizations must be made. There has been general agreement among philosophers, Davidson included, that a law is distinguished from a mere generalization by the following features:

  1. A law must support counterfactual claims. A law of the form "All A are B," for instance, is said to sustain the claim that if any arbitrary x were, contrary to fact, an A, it would also be B.
  2. It must be capable of confirmation by observable instances.

To illustrate the difference between generalizations that just happen to be true, and real laws, consider the following story (adopted from Jaegwon Kim). Assume that all objects in a fixed domain, for instance all objects in my room, are either blue or red. In addition, all of the above objects are considered either edible or inedible. By some coincidence it so happens that all red objects in my room are edible. Perhaps the red objects in my room are either ripe tomatoes or ripe cherries. This allows us to form a true generalization about this fixed domain:

(G) If x is red then x is edible.

It is obvious that (G) does not support counterfactual conditionals. For instance (G) does not allow us to infer of some green object (say a copy of Davidson's Essays on Actions and Events) that if it were red it would be edible. Davidson is quite explicit that his attack is aimed at psychophysical laws not at true psychophysical generalizations:

The thesis is rather that the mental is nomologically irreducible: there may be true general statements relating the mental and the physical, statements that have the logical form of a law; but they are not lawlike (in a strong sense to be described). If by absurdly remote chance we were to stumble on a non-probabilistic, true, psychophysical generalization, we would have no reason to believe it more than roughly true; we would have no reason to believe it was a law.

Following this view, it is important to keep in mind the fact that whether any given psychophysical generalization is true is a contingent, empirical matter. As we will see later, it is an a priori matter for Davidson that no such generalization can be a law.

The core idea of Davidson's argument against the possibility of psychophysical laws can be found in the following passage:

Nomological statements bring together predicates that we know a priori are made for each other -- know, that is, independently of knowing whether the evidence supports a connection between them. If we can know a priori when the predicates are made for each other, then we can know by the same token when they aren't. Davidson finds that it is an a priori truth that mental and physical predicates are not made for each other. Here is the structure of his argument.

  1. Both mental and physical phenomena have distinct sets of features characteristic of their own domains, but these features are incompatible with each other.
  2. Bridging laws linking properties from two distinct theoretical discourses (in this case mental and physical) would transmit properties from one discourse to another, which in case of mental and physical phenomena would lead into incoherence.
  3. Therefore, there could be no psychophysical laws linking mental and physical phenomena.

According to Davidson, the paradigmatic criterion of the mental events is their susceptibility to the description "in terms of vocabulary of propositional attitudes." Propositional attitudes, or intentional states as they are sometimes called, are various cognitive attitudes; we can have hope that the proposition p is true, we can fear that p is true, we can desire that p is true, and so forth. You and I can have different attitudes toward the proposition "Snow is white." I hope that snow is white, whereas you believe that it is but don’t hope it is. The proposition itself, namely, that snow is white, towards which one has an attitude is said to give the content to one's mental state.

Propositional attitudes have certain features (or are constrained by certain principles) that distinguish them from physical states and events. Davidson's theory of propositional attitudes is guided by conclusions drawn from the project of Radical Interpretation, a project initiated by Quine. Imagine that you have encountered a group of people in an unfamiliar land who display what appear to you to be shared verbal and non-verbal behavior. What do they mean when they point at a rabbit running by and say, “Gavagai”? Interpreting their behavior by assigning meaning to their actions (of which linguistic utterances is a subclass) is the task of Radical Interpretation. The principles and techniques we would apply in the above described situation are not unlike the principles and techniques we commonly apply in interpretation of other people's actions and utterances whose language we already share. Radical Interpretation, according to Davidson, is guided by normative principles and must proceed holistically:

This method is intended to solve the problem of the interdependence of belief and meaning by holding belief constant as far as possible while solving for meaning. This is accomplished by assigning truth conditions to alien sentences that make native speakers right when plausibly possible, according, of course to our own view of what is right.

These general normative principles that guide the task of Radical Interpretation, and therefore constrain the task of attribution of propositional attitudes, are principles such as “Don't believe an open contradiction", or "If you believe that p and q, then also believe that p." It is important to keep in mind the fact that intentional states are capable of justifying other intentional states. In physical theory the movement of one ball is explained by the movement of the other. Having a belief that pressing on a lever will stop the flow of water doesn't just explain my action of stopping the flow of water. This belief (together with the desire to stop the flow of water) also justifies my action in the sense that it makes it reasonable in the light of the above belief. (Intentional states justifying other intentional states will be discussed further in the second part of this article.) Davidson is explicit that it is a part of what it is for something to be a propositional attitude (like a belief) that it be subject to these normative principles. This makes these principles a priori and necessary constitutive of the concept of propositional attitudes. In contrast, our knowledge of things physical is a posteriori and contingent in nature.

So far, we have spent time explaining the normative character of the mental and have discussed that the interpretation must proceed holistically:

There is no assigning beliefs to a person one by one on the basis of his verbal behavior, his choices, or other local signs no matter how plain and evident, for we make sense of particular beliefs only as they cohere with other beliefs, with preferences, with intention, hopes, fears, expectation, and the rest.

It can be seen from the above remark that interpretation is holistic in the sense that the attribution of each individual mental state to another person must be made against the background of attribution of other mental states. In addition, the attribution to an agent of the entire system of propositional attitudes is further constrained by considerations that involve maximization of coherence and rationality.

Davidson is quite aware of the fact that holism and interdependence are common to physical theory. In physical theory such a priori facts as the transitivity of "longer than" is what makes physical measurements possible. Thus, the physical realm is also characterized by the a priori laws constitutive of our conception of the physical. What sets the realms of the mental and the physical apart is the disparate commitments of each realm. Rationality and the governing normative principles are essential characteristics of the mental. Thus, the absence of rationality and normative principles is a characteristic of the physical. If there were bridging laws, we would find, unhappily, that the characteristics of the mental that have "no echo in physical theory" would be transmitted to the physical and vice versa. In the first of the above scenarios we would have to apply the Principle of Charity with its rule of maximization of coherence and rationality to the physical, which, according to Davidson, is plainly absurd. In the second scenario we would have the principles governing the attribution of the mental be preempted by the merely physical constraints. This happens for the following reason: if there were bridging laws of the type (BL), then neural states of the brain would be nomologically coextensive with certain intentional states. But neural states (being theoretical states of physical theory) are governed by conditions of attribution that in turn are regulated by the constitutive rules of the physical theory. Thus, constitutive rules of the mental are ignored in this scenario. Davidson concludes that:

There are no strict psychophysical law because of the disparate commitments of the mental and physical schemes. It is a feature of physical reality that physical change can be explained by laws that connect it with other changes and conditions physically described. It is a feature of the mental that the attribution of mental phenomena must be responsible to the background of reasons, beliefs, and intentions of the individual. There cannot be tight connections between the realms if each is to retain allegiance to its proper source of evidence.

It is important for Davidson to note that the mental does have its own laws, for instance, the laws of rational decision making. The crucial difference between such laws and the laws that could be counted as psychophysical is the difference between the normative character of the former and the predictive power of the latter. When anomalism of the mental denies the existence of psychophysical and psychological laws, the sense of "law" is taken to involve strict nomological predictions and explanations of behavior. Thus, normative "laws" are quite compatible with anomalism of the mental. An interesting question is whether Davidson's notion of what constitutes a "law" has merit won’t be discussed here.

The claim of the anomalism of the mental consists of two subsidiary claims. Thus far we have considered the support for the claim that there are no psychophysical laws. Davidson also defends the claim that there could be no precise psychological laws, that is, there are no precise laws that relate mental states and events to other mental states and events. The argument for this claim can be found in "Psychology as Philosophy." As the title suggests, Davidson intends to contrast the claim that psychology is more like philosophy with the claim that it is more like science and then refute the latter claim. One point deserves special attention before we proceed to the exegesis of Davidson's argument against psychological laws. Actions, although undeniably physical under some descriptions, are considered to be mental by Davidson. This is so because, when we state which action someone is performing versus merely describing the physical movement his body is undergoing, we are contributing an interpretation of him and interpretation, as we have seen, is guided by certain normative constraints. Thus, the laws that could relate an agent's mental states to his actions would count as psychological laws.

The gist of the argument against psychological laws can be found in the following passage:

It is an error to compare truisms like “If a man wants to eat an acorn omelette, then he generally will if the opportunity exists and no other desire overrides” with a law that says how fast a body will fall in a vacuum. It is an error, because in the latter case, but not the former, we can tell in advance whether the condition holds, and we know what allowance to make if it doesn't.

If the above truism were a psychological law, then for the antecedent to obtain, the agent must want to eat an acorn omelette. But our knowledge of an agent's desires crucially depends upon our attribution of other mental states to him (or her). In addition, knowing his action subsequent to his desire will help us interpret whether the agent had the desire in the first place. Thus both the antecedent and the consequent of the supposed psychological law are related to each other through the holism of interpretation.

What is needed in the case of action, if we are to predict on the basis of desires and beliefs, is a quantitative calculus that brings all relevant beliefs and desires into the picture. There is no hope of refining the simple pattern of explanation on the basis of reasons into such a calculus.

Since no such hope exists, any psychological generalization purporting to be law must rely upon generous escape clauses such as "if no other desire overrides," ceteris paribus, and so forth. The necessity of such fail-safe clauses is dictated by the fact that for Davidson there is no "underlying mental reality whose laws we can study in abstraction from the normative and holistic perspectives of interpretation."

3. Causal Explanation of Action

Actions, according to Davidson, are events. Events, in his ontology, are particular dated occurrences; the essential feature of which is susceptibility to redescription. In order to admit an entity into one's ontology, one must specify the conditions of individuation for that entity. On Davidson's view:

[E]vents are identical if and only if they have exactly the same causes and effects.

This criterion may seem to have an air of circularity about it, but if there is circularity it certainly is not formal. For the criterion is simply this: where x and y are events,

x = y if and only if [(z) (z caused x implies z caused y) and (z) (x caused z implies y caused z)].

It is important to keep in mind that for an event to be an action, the event must be describable in a specific way. Actions are events that people perform with intentions and for reasons. One and the same action can be specified as intentional under some description and as purely physical under another description. But in order to be an action an event must have at least one description under which it is specified as intentional. The above requirement for an action hinges on the larger distinction between specifying the whole of an event with wholly specifying it. The distinction comes up in the context of the discussion of causation and causal explanation:

The salient point that emerges so far is that we must distinguish firmly between causes and the features we hit on for describing them, and hence between the question whether a statement says truly that one event causes another and the further question whether the events are characterized in such a way that we can deduce, or otherwise infer, from laws or other causal lore, that the relation was causal.

In the case of one event causing another, any description that picks out the right event specifies the whole of the cause. Some descriptions, of course, will be richer in the information they disclose about an event. This richness should not affect in any way how much of a cause they refer to. The story is quite different when it comes to what Davidson calls "the further question" of causal explanation. Causal explanations are by their very nature attempts to explain events in terms of the causes of these events. But, according to Davidson, causal explanations are, in addition, sensitive to how the events in question are described. For instance, the two descriptions "Jack's walking in the room" and "Jack's stomping in the room" may refer to the same event that caused Jill to wake up. However the latter may serve as a causal explanation of Jill's waking up, whereas the former may not.

One of Davidson's major contributions to philosophy of action is his claim that explanation via reasons is a form of causal explanation. In order to understand Davidson's claims that reasons are the causes of the actions that they are reasons for and that “reason explanation” is a form of causal explanation, we must understand how on his view causal explanation works.

One theory of causal explanation arises out of Hume's position that wherever there is a causal relation between two distinct events a and b there must be a law relating two types of events A and B that the events in question instantiate. This position has been further developed in the middle of the twentieth century by Carl Hempel into the deductive-nomological theory of explanation (DN from now on). According to DN, an event E is causally explained just in case the statement asserting the occurrence of E deductively follows from

  1. the statement asserting the occurrence of its cause C , and
  2. the statement of some general causal law L.

The opponents of the DN model argue that one can judge that an event a caused an event b without knowing the laws that these events instantiate. Davidson contends that the opposition between the opponents and the champions of the DN model is more apparent than real. The solution to the conflict depends on the distinction between events and their descriptions:

Causality and identity are relations between individual events no matter how described. But laws are linguistic; and so events can instantiate laws, and hence be explained or predicted in the light of laws, only as those events are described in one or the other way.

In short, Davidson lends his support to the principle of Nomological Character of Causality. This principle says that "when events are related as cause and effect, they have descriptions that instantiate a law. It doesn't say that every true singular statement of causality instantiates a law." It is worth noting that Davidson accepts this principle on faith, as many commentators have pointed out. Unlike David Hume, who accepts the principle because his analysis of the nature of causation as a constant conjunction requires it, Davidson disavows analyzing the nature of causation itself. His goal, explicitly stated, is to provide an analysis of the logical form of causal statements.

We can now turn to the question of the causal explanation of action and briefly discuss Davidson's impetus for his claim that reason explanation must be a form of causal explanation. Davidson's opponents (the anti-causalists) on the explanation of actions claim that reason explanation is different in kind from causal explanation. There are two main types of arguments for the anti-causalist position: methodological and conceptual. Anti-causalists who rely on methodological arguments for their position, claim that a DN model that relies on the concept of lawful regularity has a place only in the physical sciences. By contrast, the primary constraint placed on explanation in the social sciences is a normative one. Thus, lawful regularities relating reasons to actions would be simply irrelevant to explanation in social sciences, according to anti-causalists.

Conceptual arguments are meant to establish the stronger claim that reasons cannot in principle be causes. One plausible argument of the conceptual variety rests on the assumption that "the presence of a reason cannot be ascertained independently of the occurrence of the action it rationalizes." This, presumably, leads to the disparate evidential commitments of the causal explanation and reason explanation. Davidson himself appears to advocate the above point in the passage quoted above. Thus, all arguments against the causalist position, including the ones briefly mentioned, revolve around the normative constraints placed on the explanation of the mental.

In short, an explanation of an agent's action can be considered adequate only if it shows the action in question to be reasonable against the background of an agent's beliefs and desires. This latter condition together with the truth condition, which states that the propositional attitudes a rationalization attributes to an agent must be true, form the necessary conditions for the justification model of explanation. Davidson considers the above conditions necessary but not sufficient. The deficiency of the justification model is explained by drawing attention to the distinction between having a reason for an action and having the reason why one performs an action. For a reason to be the reason why one performs an action the reason must cause the action. For example, one has a reason to turn on the television, say, to watch one's favorite TV show. But this need not be the reason why one turns on the television. This is because the above reason did not cause one to turn on the television. As Davidson puts it:

[S]omething essential has certainly been left out, for a person can have a reason for an action, and perform the action, and yet this reason not be the reason why he did it.

In our example, the reason for one to turn on the television, let’s say, is that one is lonely and desires company. Thus, one reason (namely, to keep one company) was the cause of the action while the other reason (namely, to watch one's favorite show) was not. Davidson continues:

Of course, we can include this idea too in justification; but then the notion of justification becomes as dark as the notion of reason until we can account for the force of that “because.”

The mere possibility that a person acted on the basis of one reason rather than another presents an insurmountable obstacle. The anti-causalist has no way of accounting for the force of the "because" in the rationalization. Thus, the justification model is silent on what would count as the correct rationalization. The only solution, according to Davidson, is to view the efficacious reasons (the ones that account for the correct rationalization) as causes of action. This leaves us, according to Davidson, with only one alternative to justificationalism, namely, the view that reason explanation is a species of causal explanation.

4. References and Further Reading

Davidson's research primarily ran in articles published from the 1960s through the 1990s, most of which have conveniently been reprinted. The first two collections contain Davidson's most influential works, and the last volume cited below is a good place to begin. [This section on references and further reading was composed by Paul Saka.]

a. Primary Sources

  • Essays on Actions and Events. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1980.
    • Includes "Mental Events," which introduces anomalous monism; “The Logical Form of Action Sentences," an important semantic theory of adverbs; "Actions, Reasons, and Causes", which famously argues that rationalization is a species of causal explanation. To the revised edition (2001) is added "Adverbs of Action" and a short reply to Quine.
  • Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1984.
    • Includes "Semantics for Natural Languages," a good place for beginners to start; "Truth and Meaning," the locus classicus of Davidsonian semantics; "Quotation" and "On Saying That," which offer extensional analyses of intensional phenomena; “Radical Interpretation," “Belief and the Basis of Meaning," and “On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme" on the principle of charity; “Thought and Talk," which argues that only verbal creatures can think; "Reality without Reference," which concedes that reference is not real; and a pioneering treatment in analytic philosophy on metaphor. To the revised edition (2001) is added a short reply to Quine.
  • Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001.
    • Includes "Knowing One's Own Mind", source of the Swampman argument.
  • Problems of Rationality. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004.
    • Follows up on themes from Davidson's first collection; includes an interview of Davidson by Ernie Lepore.
  • Truth, Language, and History. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
    • Includes the highly cited “The Folly of Trying to Define Truth" plus six other articles on truth; six articles on language; two articles on anomalous monism; and minor articles in the history of philosophy.
  • Truth and Predication. Boston: Harvard University Press, 2005.
    • Part I is a revised version of Davidson's 1989 Dewey Lectures, first published as "The Structure and Content of the Theory of Truth" in the Journal of Philosophy. Part II, on predication, is a version of Davidson's 2001 Hermes Lectures.
  • The Essential Davidson. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006.
    • Consists of six articles taken from Essays on Actions and Events, five articles taken from Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, three articles taken from Davidson's other collections, and "A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge", taken from the Journal of Philosophy.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Ludwig, Kirk, ed. Donald Davidson. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • Accessible contributions, each on one aspect of Davidson's work: actions, events, truth and meaning, radical interpretation, literature, knowledge.
  • Lepore, Ernest, and Ludwig, Kirk. 2005. Donald Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language, and Reality. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A sustained and authoritative treatment of how Davidson's projects tie together, and their significance to philosophy.
  • Lepore, Ernest, and Ludwig, Kirk. 2009. Donald Davidson’s Truth-Theoretic Semantics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Foundations and applications of Davidsonian semantics, relevant for philosophers of language and linguists.
  • Hahn, Edwin Lewis. 1999. The Philosophy of Donald Davidson. The Library of Living Philosophers, volume XXVII. Peru, IL: Open Court Publishing Company.
    • Includes, as do all volumes in the Library of Living Philosophers, an intellectual autobiography and extensive bibliography.

Author Information

Vladimir Kalugin
California State University, Northridge
U. S. A.

Madhyamaka Buddhist Philosophy

Madhyamaka Buddhist Philosophy

buddhaMadhyamaka and Yogācāra are the two main philosophical trajectories associated with the Mahāyāna stream of Buddhist thought. According to Tibetan doxographical literature, Madhyamaka represents the philosophically definitive expression of Buddhist doctrine. Stemming from the second-century writings of Nāgārjuna, Madhyamaka developed in the form of commentaries on his works. This style of development is characteristic of the basically scholastic character of the Indian philosophical tradition. The commentaries elaborated not only varying interpretations of Nāgārjuna’s philosophy but also different understandings of the philosophical tools that are appropriate to its advancement. Tibetan interpreters generally claim to take the seventh-century commentaries of Candrakīrti as authoritative, but Indian commentators subsequent to him were in fact more influential in the course of Indian philosophy. Madhyamaka also had considerable influence (though by way of a rather different set of texts) in East Asian Buddhism, where a characteristic interpretive concern has been to harmonize Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. Although perhaps most frequently characterized by modern interpreters as a Buddhist version of skepticism, Madhyamaka arguably develops metaphysical concerns. The logically elusive character of Madhyamaka arguments has fascinated and perplexed generations of scholars. This is surely appropriate with regard to a school whose principal term of art, “emptiness” (śūnyatā), reflects developments in Buddhist thought from the high scholasticism of Tibet to the enigmatic discourse of East Asian Zen.

Table of Contents

  1. Nāgārjuna and the Paradoxical “Perfection of Wisdom” Literature
  2. The Basic Philosophical Impulse
    1. The “Two Truths” in Buddhist Abhidharma
    2. The Interminability of Dependent Origination
    3. Ethics and the Charge of Nihilism
  3. The Question of Self-contradiction and the Possible Truth of Mādhyamika Claims
  4. Historical Development of Indian Schools of Interpretation
  5. More on the Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Difference: Madhyamaka and Buddhist Epistemology
  6. Madhyamaka in Tibet
  7. Madhyamaka in East Asia
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Nāgārjuna and the Paradoxical “Perfection of Wisdom” Literature

“Madhyamaka” is a Sanskrit word that simply means “middle way.” (The derivative form “Mādhyamika” literally means “of or relating to the middle,” and conventionally designates an adherent of the school, or qualifies some aspect of its thought.) Madhyamaka refers to the Indian Buddhist school of thought that develops in the form of commentaries on the works of Nāgārjuna, who flourished around 150 C.E. Nāgārjuna figures in the traditional accounts developed to authenticate the literature of the self-styled “Mahāyāna” stream of Buddhist thought. Arguing that sūtras known to have begun circulating only at the beginning of the first millennium could nevertheless represent the authentic teaching of the Buddha (buddhavacana), proponents of Mahāyāna invoked the characteristically Buddhist idea of “skill in means” (upāyakauśalya); they thus claimed that the Mahāyāna sūtras promulgate an advanced stage of the Buddha’s teaching such as would not have been appropriately taught to the earliest auditors of the Buddha, who, unprepared by the necessarily preparatory earlier teachings, might draw nihilistic conclusions from the sūtras. It is Nāgārjuna who is said first to have recovered and promulgated these sūtras, having retrieved the Prajñāpāramitā (“Perfection of Wisdom”) literature from the underwater kingdom of the “Nāgas,” or serpent kings.

Two texts generally represent the criteria for attributing authorship of a text to Nāgārjuna. So, this name conventionally refers to the person who wrote the Mūlamadhyamakakārikās (MMK, “Verses on the Firmly Fixed Middle Way”) and the Vigrahavyāvartanī (VV, “Turning Back Objections”). Both of these texts, but particularly the former, have occasioned a great deal of interest among Indologists and philosophers. This is not surprising, since the MMK is indeed a rich text. Stylistically lucid yet logically enigmatic, Nāgārjuna’s major work shares with the Prajñāpāramitā literature a characteristic air of paradox, which Madhyamaka’s critics see as evidence of nihilism if not of incoherence. We read in this text, for example, that “there is, on the part of saṃsāra, no difference at all from nirvāṇa” (MMK 25.19). The text’s first verse says “There do not exist, anywhere at all, any existents whatsoever, arisen either from themselves or from something else, either from both or altogether without cause.” (MMK 1.1)

2. The Basic Philosophical Impulse

a. The “Two Truths” in Buddhist Abhidharma

In styling the school that develops from Nāgārjuna’s works the “middle way” (an expression used by Nāgārjuna himself), proponents of Madhyamaka exploited a long-invoked Buddhist trope. Traditional accounts of the life of the Buddha typically characterize him as striking a “middle way” between the extravagance of the courtly life that had been available to him as a prince and the extreme asceticism he is said initially to have tried in his pursuit of transformative insight. Philosophically, the relevant extremes between which any Buddhist account of the person must steer are “eternalism” and “nihilism.” Eternalism (śāśvatavāda) is the view that there are enduring existents of which the self is an example. Nihilism (ucchedavāda) might be termed “eliminativism,” and denotes, for Buddhists, the view that actions (karma) have no ethical consequences, insofar as the agents of actions cannot be said to endure as the subjects who will experience their effects.

Given their characteristically Buddhist concern to refuse the existence of an ultimately existent “self,” it is the nihilism pole that Mādhyamikas must work hardest to avoid. Indeed, the concern to avoid charges of nihilism represents one of the most significant preoccupations of Mādhyamika philosophers. This concern has to be understood in terms of the traditionally Buddhist idea of “two truths,” or two levels of explanation or description: the familiar level of discourse that includes reference to the “conventionally existent” (saṃvṛtisat), and the level which makes reference only to what is “ultimately existent” (parmārthasat). Most schools of Buddhist philosophy can be understood in terms of the sense in which they deny the “ultimate” existence of the self, while affirming its “conventional” existence.

In its basically Ābhidharmika iterations (that is, in the ways elaborated in the earliest scholastic literature of Indian Buddhism, the so-called “Abhidharma”) this denial of the ultimate existence of the self is an idea that can be understood as comparable to a great deal of contemporary philosophical discussion. Philosophical projects in cognitive science can be said, for example, to turn on questions of how (or perhaps whether) to relate two levels of description: (1) the broadly intentional level of description that generally reflects the first-person, phenomenological perspective (and that is also reflected in ordinary language and interactions), and (2) the scientific level of description at which the real explanatory work is done. Similarly, the broadly Ābhidharmika trajectory of Buddhist philosophy has it that the two truths basically consist in two sets of existing things: the set of conventionally existent (saṃvṛtisat) things and the set of ultimately existent (parmārthasat) things. The “conventionally existent” comprises all reducible or supervenient phenomena (basically, all temporally enduring macro-objects); the “ultimately existent” represents the set of ontological primitives, which the Abhidharma literature calls “dharmas.” It is ultimately the case, then, that causal interactions among the dharmas exhaustively explain all conventional events.

The works of Nāgārjuna and his philosophical heirs are best understood as constitutively opposed to this understanding of the two truths. The foundational idea of Madhyamaka is that the set of ultimately existent things is an empty set – a point that Mādhyamikas characteristically promote by insisting on the emptiness (śūnyatā) not only of wholes such as persons, but also of the analytic categories (dharmas) to which these are reduced in Abhidharma literature. The works of Nāgārjuna and his commentators, then, typically comprise arguments to the effect that none of the analytic categories (dharmas) and concepts used to explain anything can be coherently formulated. More precisely, the argument is that no such categories can intrinsically provide any explanatory purchase on the phenomena they purportedly explain.

b. The Interminability of Dependent Origination

In proceeding this way, Mādhyamikas can be understood to think that the ontologizing impulse of Abhidharma compromises the most important insight of the Buddhist tradition – which is, on the Mādhyamika reading, that all existents are “dependently originated” (pratītyasamutpanna). (The cardinal doctrine of the “dependent origination” of all existents represents the flip-side of the Buddhist denial of a “self”; that is, the reason we do not have unitary and enduring selves just is that any moment of experience can be explained as having originated from innumerable causes, none of which can be specified as what we “really” are.) More precisely, Mādhyamikas can be said to have recognized that the ontological primitives posited by Abhidharma could have explanatory purchase only if they are posited as an exception to the rule that everything is dependently originated; that is, dependently originated existents could only be ultimately explained by something that does not itself require the same kind of explanation. But it is precisely the Mādhyamika point to emphasize that there is no exception to this rule; phenomena are dependently originated all the way down, and it is therefore impossible to specify precisely what it is upon which anything finally depends. Hence, there can be no set of “ultimately existent” things.

Mādhyamika arguments to this effect typically work by showing that all explanatory categories turn out to be constitutively dependent upon the phenomena they purportedly explain – as, for example, notions such as “fire” and “fuel,” “action” and “agent,” or “cause” and “effect” are intelligible only relative to one another. To show the constitutively relative (that is, dependent) character of all such explanatory categories and phenomena is effectively to make the one point that Mādhyamikas are most concerned to make: that insofar as there is nothing that is not dependently originated, there is therefore nothing that is not “empty” (śūnya). (This paraphrases MMK 24.19, which says: “Since there is no dharma whatsoever that is not dependently originated, therefore there is no dharma whatsoever that is not empty.”)

In thus characterizing all categories and all existents as finally “empty,” what Mādhyamikas mean is that they are empty of what we may translate as “essence” (svabhāva). This is true just insofar as they exist not “essentially” (svabhāvena), but only relatively – that is, only in relation to other existents and categories. In arguing thus, Mādhyamikas – typifying characteristically Sanskritic styles of argumentation, in which the terms and analyses of the Sanskrit grammarians figure prominently – exploit the etymology of the word svabhāva. Although the semantic range of this Sanskrit word typically comprises ideas like “defining characteristic” or “identity,” the word can etymologically be read as referring to something “existent” (bhāva) “by itself” (sva-). Among the recently debated exegetical questions concerning Madhyamaka has been whether important Mādhyamika arguments centrally involve an equivocation on this term, unwarrantedly equating “identity” with “causally independent existence.”

c. Ethics and the Charge of Nihilism

It is not only in their characteristically Buddhist denial of a really existent “self,” but also in their more radical (and rhetorically charged) emphasis on the universally obtaining character of emptiness that Mādhyamikas recurrently elicited charges of nihilism – a charge as often issuing from proponents of other Buddhist schools as from the various Brahmanical schools of Indian philosophy. One of the most prominently recurrent sorts of exchange in Nāgārjuna’s MMK involves an interlocutor’s presupposing that by ‘emptiness’ Mādhyamikas must mean non-existence. For example, the twenty-fourth chapter of the MMK begins with the challenge of an imagined interlocutor (this one clearly another Buddhist): “If all this is empty, then there’s neither production nor destruction; it follows, for you, that the Four Noble Truths don’t exist.” (MMK 24.1) The rejoinder (at MMK 24.20): it is in fact only because everything is empty – which just is to say, dependently originated – that the Four Noble Truths can obtain. That is, the fact that existents only come into being in mutual dependence upon one another (and are therefore “empty” of an essence) is all that makes it possible for (what is the first Noble Truth) suffering to arise – and thus having arisen as a contingent and dependent phenomenon, to be caused to cease (the third Noble Truth). If, in contrast, suffering were the “natural” or “essential” state of affairs (svabhāva), this would (as Nāgārjuna sees it) mean that it could not be interrupted, and the cultivation of the entire Buddhist path would be impossible.

It is particularly important for the proponent of Madhyamaka to foreclose the possibility of a nihilist reading of claims regarding emptiness insofar as it is finally the ethical and soteriological project of Buddhist practice that is thought to be at stake. In this regard, the characteristically Mādhyamika conviction is that it is in fact the Ābhidharmika iteration of the Buddhist project (and not Mādhyamika claims regarding emptiness) that is “nihilist.” This is because on the characteristically Ābhidharmika understanding of the “two truths,” the world as “conventionally” described – as consisting, for example, in suffering persons whose plight should elicit compassionate dedication to the Buddhist path – is finally altogether superseded by the privileged level of description constitutively developed in the Abhidharma literature. The characteristically Ābhidharmika enumeration of the dharmas that putatively constitute the set of “ultimately existent” things amounts to the specification of what “really” exists instead of the self. If, in contrast, it is recognized that no such privileged level of description can coherently be elaborated – that, in other words, there is no set of ontological primitives in terms of which the only real explanatory work can be done, and that in that sense there is nothing “more real” than the world as conventionally described – then the world is finally to be accepted as irreducibly “conventional,” and the persons therein can hence be regarded as ethical agents who are not finally eliminable in terms of the analytic categories of Abhidharma.

3. The Question of Self-contradiction and the Possible Truth of Mādhyamika Claims

But this understanding also raises what are surely the most philosophically complex and interesting problems in understanding Madhyamaka: if the constitutive claim of Madhyamaka is to be taken as one to the effect that the ultimate truth is that there is (in the sense described) no “ultimate truth,” it is easy to ask: What is the status of this claim itself? It would seem open to the Mādhyamika only to allow that it is itself conventionally true – but is that not just to say that one may as well choose not to adopt this particular “convention”? The problem, then, is whether characteristically Mādhyamika claims are, to the extent they are true, performatively self-contradictory or self-referentially incoherent. This problem was well understood (if not always clearly addressed) by proponents of Madhyamaka, and is very much in play in characteristically Mādhyamika claims to the effect that “emptiness” itself is empty – that, in other words, the Mādhyamika analysis is to be applied not only to all existents, but also to this analysis thereof.

To say as much is the only way consistently to affirm the universal scope of claims regarding emptiness; for there would clearly be a performative self-contradiction in claiming that “all existents are empty-cum-dependently-originated,” while yet allowing that claim itself to stand as an exception – as itself having, that is, the kind of “ultimately” privileged explanatory purchase that is denied with respect to all other analyses. But it is a complex matter whether the Mādhyamika can, in avoiding this route to self-contradiction, affirm the “emptiness of emptiness” without thereby depriving his own claim of any purchase. It is particularly at this point, then, that there is an air of paradox going to the heart of Mādhyamika discourse, finding expression in, for example, apparent claims to the effect that no claim is being made; hence, such quintessentially Mādhyamika tropes as the claim that Madhyamaka advances no philosophical “thesis” (pratijñā), and that “emptiness” does not reflect any specific “view” (dṛṣṭi).

Such rhetoric characteristically expresses what is surely the central interpretive and philosophical issue at stake in understanding Madhyamaka, and it is not surprising, in this regard, that Madhyamaka should often have been interpreted by modern scholars as having affinities with Hellenistic skepticism. Another line of interpretation (often inflected in recent years by appeal to Wittgenstein, or to various poststructuralist thinkers) has it that Mādhyamika claims not to be making any claim should be taken seriously as expressing a basically “therapeutic” sort of stance – one meant performatively to undermine (in something like the same way, perhaps, as in the Zen discourse of koans) soteriologically counter-productive profusions of discursive thought. This line of interpretation can be warranted by characteristically Mādhyamika talk about the elimination of prapañca (often translated as conceptual “proliferation”), and by paeans to the “ultimate truth” as something finally ineffable.

Such readings are, however, difficult to reconcile with what many Tibetan interpreters (perhaps notwithstanding such rhetoric) took to be the constitutively Mādhyamika claim: namely, that “emptiness” just means (and is the only way consistently to describe) “dependent origination.” If it is said, for example, that there is nothing “non-empty” just insofar as there is nothing that is not dependently originated (here again, paraphrasing MMK 24.19), that would seem to preclude, at least, the truth of statements (made, e.g., by certain theists) to the effect that there is something (e.g., God) that is necessarily (or otherwise not dependently) existent. If the Mādhyamika statement does not rule out the truth of such statements, then it would be difficult to understand it as meaning anything (although perhaps the radically “therapeutic” interpreter of Madhyamaka will here bite the bullet and, well, argue that it is the very idea of “meaning” anything that is to be jettisoned); but to say that the Mādhyamika claim contradicts a truth-claim proffered by some theists just is to say that the former claim, too, is proposed as true. Recognizing that, one might urge that the universal scope of the Mādhyamika claim entails that there is an important sense in which Madhyamaka is constitutively anti-skeptical – that, indeed, Mādhyamika arguments advance a finally metaphysical point. For example, one could argue that what is at stake here is the properly transcendental fact that emptiness (understood as the fact that things exist only interdependently) is a condition of the possibility of any existents and of any analysis thereof.

The question for the proponent of such a line of interpretation then becomes: If “the ultimate truth is that there is no ultimate truth,” is it possible to think of this claim as itself ultimately true? It is important to note, in this regard, that while Mādhyamikas characteristically (indeed, constitutively) eschew the Ābhidharmika idea that “ultimate truth” involves a domain of enumerable existents regarding which claims are to be judged for their adequacy, Madhyamaka nevertheless makes abundant reference to the “ultimate truth.” One way to make sense of this is to attribute to Madhyamaka a basically deflationist account of truth – that is, one according to which calling a claim “true” is to be explained not as predicating a metaphysical property (such as “correspondence” with “ultimately existent” things) of it, but simply as committing oneself to it. On such a view, to the extent that the (Ābhidharmika) idea of “ultimate truth” has been shown incoherent, all that remains is the level of “truth” that is characterized by common-sense realism.

This interpretation has the advantage of fitting quite well with the kind of traditional doxographical accounts (influentially developed, early on, by the Indian Mādhyamika Bhāvaviveka) that figure prominently in the Tibetan monastic curriculum. These represent the schools of Indian Buddhist philosophy in an ascending hierarchy of progressively more refined views, the understanding of each of which requires having rightly understood its predecessors. On such an account, Madhyamaka, though framed as an uncompromising critique of Ābhidharmika Buddhism, nevertheless depends on the latter: if the naive realism of non-Buddhas consists in thinking there is something more real (paradigmatically, selves) underlying our experience of the world, the realization of the “deflated” realism of Madhyamaka differs from that (and is therefore transformative) only insofar as one has first pursued to its limits the kind of reductionist exercise that shows how unstable is our naive self-grasping. If one has not first entertained the Ābhidharmika’s reductionist approach, then there would be no difference between the common-sense realism of the Mādhyamika, and that of ordinary ignorant persons. But if one realizes the necessary failure of the reductionist’s privileged level of description only after having entertained it, the resultant “realism” will be inflected by the transformative understanding that our selves are “real” in the only sense in which anything (even the purportedly “ultimate” existents that are dharmas) can be real – that is, relatively, dependently.

Another strategy (perhaps not mutually exclusive of the foregoing) is to emphasize that what Mādhyamikas refute, under the heading of “ultimate truth,” is simply the idea of a privileged level of description (in the form of a set of enumerable ontological primitives) – but that the abstract fact of there being no such set is itself really (indeed metaphysically) true. In that case, the salient point is just that the truth of the Mādhyamika claim does not consist in its reference to – its correspondence with – a specifiable domain of objects. This reconstruction can be coupled with an understanding of Mādhyamika arguments as basically transcendental arguments. Such an interpretation makes good sense, at least, of what is surely one of the most prominently recurrent rhetorical strategies of Nāgārjuna; so, Nāgārjuna can be understood to argue that his various interlocutors’ objections are incoherent just insofar as these very objections presuppose the truth of Nāgārjuna’s claims. Emptiness is not only not mutually exclusive of the Four Noble Truths – it is a condition of the possibility thereof. Emptiness is, moreover, a condition of the possibility even of an opponent’s denying this; for any analysis or denial at all (indeed, any cognitive act) consists, in the first instance, in some relation.

Perhaps more suggestively, such an interpretation can also help map the finally ethical concerns of Madhyamaka onto some contemporary arguments concerning reductionist accounts of the person. In this regard, it was noted that the Ābhidharmika trajectory of Buddhist philosophy can be understood as analogous to various projects in cognitive science. In the idiom of the latter, then, it could be said that the Ābhidharmika idea is that there is, “conventionally,” an intentional level of description (variously characterized as the “common-sense” view, “folk psychology,” etc.); and, “ultimately,” a scientific level of description, comprising the ontological primitives that alone are said “really” to exist, and exhaustively to explain the former level. One line of critique developed against such approaches is to argue that anyone offering an exhaustively “impersonal,” non-intentional description of (what we think of as) persons can be shown necessarily to presuppose precisely the personal, intentional level of description that is purportedly explained. Similarly, the upshot of the Mādhyamika argument that the world is (as expressed above) “irreducibly conventional” is that the level of description at which “persons” are in play cannot coherently be thought to be eliminable. Many of the commentator Candrakīrti’s arguments can be said, without too great a stretch, to make something like this point, recurrently urging against various interlocutors that any purported attempt to explain the conventional world (in terms that, if the proposed account is to have any explanatory purchase, must not themselves be conventional) inevitably founders on the unavoidability of presupposing the conventional senses of words.

Suffice it to say that the philosophical and exegetical issues in play here are highly complex, and that almost any attempt at understanding the texts of Nāgārjuna and his commentators is likely to require a considerable effort of rational reconstruction – which perhaps explains the enduring appeal of this trajectory of thought.

4. Historical Development of Indian Schools of Interpretation

The Indian Buddhist tradition attests two broad streams in the interpretation of Nāgārjuna’s thought, corresponding roughly to what later Tibetan interpreters would refer to as the “Prāsaṅgika” and “Svātantrika” accounts of Madhyamaka. Interpreters of the former sort are so-called because of their view that Madhyamaka should be advanced only by reducing an opponent’s arguments to absurdity. Nāgārjuna is, on this view, to be interpreted as showing only the unwanted consequences (“prasaṅga”) entailed by his opponents’ claims, and not as defending any philosophical “thesis” (pratijñā) of his own. Svātantrikas, in contrast, are so-called because of their characteristic view that Nāgārjuna’s verses require restatement as formally valid inferences (svatantra-anumāna) whose conclusions are to be affirmed. Much contemporary debate has concerned whether these divergent lines of interpretation reflect only differing dialectical strategies, or whether (as influential Tibetan proponents of the distinction claim) they involve significantly different ontological presuppositions. Although the characterizations of these two trajectories of interpretation are not without basis in the antecedent Indian texts, this doxographic lens is of interest partly for what it can tell us about some characteristically Tibetan preoccupations (and about the influence of certain schools of Tibetan Buddhist philosophy on the contemporary interpretation of Indian Buddhist thought).

Names traditionally associated with the “Prāsaṅgika” stream of interpretation include Āryadeva, who is traditionally regarded as Nāgārjuna’s direct disciple (making his date close to Nāgārjuna’s), and who wrote the Catuḥśataka (“400 Verses”) – a text that is particularly important insofar as the divergent interpretations of it by the commentators Dharmapāla (530-561) and Candrakīrti are sometimes taken to herald a decisive split between Madhyamaka and Yogācāra (see Tillemans 1990); Buddhapālita (fl. c. 500), the author of a complete commentary (now extant only in Tibetan translation) on the MMK; and Candrakīrti (c. 600-650), whose Prasannapadā (“Clear Words”) – the only commentary on the MMK known to be extant in Sanskrit – preserves the Sanskrit text of Nāgārjuna’s verse text.

Candrakīrti is also the author of, among other works, the Madhyamakāvatāra (“Introduction to Madhyamaka”), an independent work (with auto-commentary) that represents the principal text for the “Madhyamaka” component of many Tibetan monastic curricula. This work is structured on the model of texts like the Daśabhūmika Sūtra, with chapters corresponding to that text’s progression in a bodhisattva’s mastery of ten “perfections” (pāramitā). The sixth chapter (fittingly corresponding to prajñāpāramitā, the “perfection of wisdom”) is by far the longest and the most philosophically rich, comprising, inter alia, important Mādhyamika critiques of Yogācāra.

Significant later Prāsaṅgikas include Śāntideva (fl. early eighth century), the author of the Bodhicaryāvatāra (“Introduction to the Conduct of Awakening”), an eloquent and popular text whose difficult ninth chapter (helpfully elaborated by the commentary of Prajñākaramati, who likely flourished in the tenth century) comprises important Mādhyamika arguments; and Dīpaṃkaraśrījñāna (982-1054; more popularly known as “Atiśa”), who figured prominently in the transmission of Indian Buddhism to Tibet, where he lived when he wrote the Bodhipathapradīpa (“A Lamp for the Path to Awakening”).

The “Svātantrika” line of interpretation originates with Bhāvaviveka (c. 500-570; his name is also reported as “Bhāviveka,” and he is often referred to as “Bhavya”), the author not only of a commentary on the MMK – the Prajñāpradīpa, now extant only in Tibetan and Chinese translations – but also of an independent work, the Madhyamakahṛdayakārikās, “Verses on the Heart of Madhyamaka,” with an auto-commentary entitled Tarkajvāla (“Blaze of Logic”). Other significant exponents of this line of thought include Jñānagarbha (fl. early eighth century), who is traditionally regarded as the teacher of Śāntarakṣita (725-788). The latter is the author of the Madhyamakālaṃkāra (“Ornament of Madhyamaka”), a relatively concise text elaborating Śāntarakṣita’s characteristic synthesis of Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. Śāntarakṣita is perhaps more widely known for the Tattvasaṃgraha (“Summa of Quiddities”), a massive treatise that takes on a huge range of Indian philosophical doctrines – and that quotes extensively from Brahmanical and other Buddhist philosophers, making it an important source of fragments from Indian works that do not, like the Tattvasaṃgraha, survive in Sanskrit.

The latter text is (like the Madhyamakālaṃkāra) helpfully illuminated by a commentary (the Tattvasaṃgrahapañjikā) by Śāntarakṣita’s student and disciple Kamalaśīla (c.740-795). The latter traveled with his teacher to Tibet, where both thinkers figure prominently in the founding events of Tibetan Buddhist thought. Kamalaśīla is, for example, traditionally regarded by Tibetans as having advocated the “gradualist” position in a famous debate at the bSam-yas monastery with a Chinese exponent of the Ch’an (“Zen”) understanding of “sudden enlightenment.” It was Kamalaśīla’s victory in this debate that established the “gradualist” understanding as at least officially normative for most schools of Tibetan Buddhism; while the occurrence of the debate itself may be apocryphal, such a position is surely reflected in Kamalaśīla’s three Bhāvanākrama (“stages of cultivation”) texts, written in Tibet.

5. More on the Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Difference: Madhyamaka and Buddhist Epistemology

As indicated, the so-called Svātantrika trajectory of Madhyamaka constitutively involves recourse to the tools of formal logic and inference, evincing a characteristic concern to restate Nāgārjuna’s arguments as formally valid inferences. More generally, it can be said that this approach is informed by Bhāvaviveka’s use of the logic and epistemology of Dignāga (c. 480-540), who influentially appealed to the idiom of pramāṇavidyā (the “discipline of logic and epistemology”) in advancing the Buddhist position – and who was, indeed, among the most important figures in developing the broadly Sanskritic conceptual vocabulary that would predominate in the subsequent course of Indian philosophy. Similarly, such later Svātantrikas as Śāntarakṣita were informed by the project of Dignāga’s influential expositor Dharmakīrti (c. 600-660), and figures such as Dharmakīrti and Śāntarakṣita would be of decisive importance for the remaining course of the Indian Buddhist philosophical tradition’s life. (Candrakīrti, in contrast, would exercise little influence in India, though he re-emerges with the Tibetan tradition’s interest in him.)

The dispute between these lines of interpretation crystallizes around the figures of Buddhapālita, Bhāvaviveka, and Candrakīrti – and can be seen, in particular, in their respective elaborations of Nāgārjuna’s MMK 1.1 (“There do not exist, anywhere at all, any existents whatsoever, arisen either from themselves or from something else, either from both or altogether without cause”). This verse basically deploys a standard tool in the Mādhyamika arsenal: the “tetralemma” (catuṣkoṭi), a four-fold statement that is meant to identify all possible relations between any category and its putative explananda (e.g., “the same,” “different,” “both the same and different,” “neither the same nor different”) – with the standard Mādhyamika denial of all four horns of the tetralemma meant as an exhaustive refutation of the efficacy and coherence of the category in question. (One modern interpretive discussion concerns whether or not this apparent violation of bivalent logic shows Mādhyamikas to have presupposed a non-standard sort of logic.)

Buddhapālita’s “prāsaṅgika” commentary on this verse does nothing more than make clear (what he takes to be) the absurd consequences that would be entailed by affirming any one of the positions here rejected. For example, the view that existents originate intrinsically – a position traditionally understood to express the Indian Sāṃkhya school’s characteristic view that effects are always latent within their causes – is to be denied “since there would be no point in the arising of already existent things.” That is, an affirmation of the causation of something from itself entails that the thing in question already exists, in which case, its coming-into-being could not be thought to require causal explanation.

In his commentary on the MMK, Bhāvaviveka then specifically took Buddhapālita to task, urging that Buddhapālita’s elaboration of the argument was unreasonable “because no reason and no example are given and because faults stated by the opponent are not answered” – which is to say, because the recognized terms of a formally stated inference (as that had been thematized by Sanskritic philosophers such as Dignāga) were not present. In contrast, then, to Buddhapālita, Bhāvaviveka offers a formally valid statement of the reasoning behind Nāgārjuna’s denial of the first horn of the verse’s tetralemma: “[Thesis:] It is certain that the inner sense fields (āyatanas) do not ultimately originate from themselves; [Reason:] because they exist [already], [Example:] like consciousness.” Among the characteristic features of Bhāvaviveka’s restatement here is his making explicit the qualifier “ultimately” (or “essentially,” svabhāvataḥ); that is, Nāgārjuna is here said to deny only that something is the case essentially or ultimately. While the first horn of this tetralemma (“existents are arisen from themselves”) perhaps requires no such qualification in order for its denial to be intelligible, many interpreters would agree that such a qualification must be added particularly in order for the denial of the second (which concerns that origination of things from other existents) to make any sense; for it is surely counter-intuitive to think that we cannot even conventionally speak of the origination of existents from one another. A great many of Nāgārjuna’s prima facie counter-intuitive refutations can be understood to make more sense if they are qualified as concerning what is “ultimately” or “essentially” the case (and not taken simpliciter).

A considerable portion of the first chapter of Candrakīrti’s Prasannapadā is then given over to defending Buddhapālita’s as the right way to proceed, and to criticizing Bhāvaviveka’s interpretive procedure as misguided. How, then, are we to make sense, without Bhāvaviveka’s characteristic qualification, of Nāgārjuna’s denial of the second horn of the tetralemma – of his denial, that is, that things originate from other existents? On Candrakīrti’s reading (which follows Buddhapālita’s), the absurdity that would be entailed by thinking otherwise would be that a sprout could just as well be produced from the coals of a fire as from a seed; and, conversely, if a sprout cannot be produced from the coals of a fire, it cannot be said to be produced from a seed, either. Candrakīrti’s argument here is usefully understood as involving a priori (as contra a posteriori) analysis; that is, the argument short-circuits any appeal to what we experience to be the case, instead analyzing only the concepts presupposed in how we explain experience – and the point is to reduce to absurdity any argument that presupposes the independence of such concepts (that presupposes, in other words, that any such concepts might afford a privileged perspective on what there is). Read this way, the argument turns simply on the definition of “other,” and the point is that the general concept of “otherness” leaves us with no principled way to know which other things are relevantly connected to the thing whose arising we seek to explain, and we are left to suppose that anything that is “other” than the latter (even the coals of a fire) could give rise to it.

Although many Tibetan exegetes were (as noted) inclined to see the dispute here as turning on subtle ontological presuppositions, this can be hard to glean from the Indian texts upon which the dispute is based. The characteristically Svātantrika appeal to the idiom of logic and epistemology can, however, be understood as meant to address what are real philosophical problems in the Mādhyamika project as that is understood by Candrakīrti – just as Candrakīrti, for his part, can be understood as having philosophically principled reasons for refusing the epistemological tools characteristically deployed by Bhāvaviveka and his heirs. What is at issue here is, once again, the question of how we are to regard the “conventionally” described world once the idea that there can be an “ultimately” true description thereof has been jettisoned. Nāgārjuna himself had emphasized the importance of some kind of relation in this regard, saying, for example, that “without relying on convention, the ultimate is not taught; without having understood the ultimate, nirvāṇa is not apprehended” (MMK 24.10). In other words, the (relative) reality of the conventionally described world is a condition of the possibility of our coming to understand what is ultimately the case; but if what is understood thereby is in fact that there is nothing “more real” than the conventionally described world – that, e.g., there are no ontological primitives that are not themselves subject to the conditions that obtain in the world – then it might be thought that, as it were, “anything goes.”

The philosophical worry, then, is that if Mādhyamika arguments are not understood in something like the way that Svātantrikas propose, Madhyamaka could degenerate into a thoroughgoing and pernicious conventionalism. The broadly Svātantrika line of interpretation attempts to address this worry by arguing that even if all discourse (including that of the Mādhyamika) perforce takes place at the “conventional” level, it is nevertheless the case that some “conventions” are more nearly true than others – and that the epistemological tools developed by Dignāga and Dharmakīrti give us the resources to sort these out. The Svātantrika Jñānagarbha (followed, in this regard, by his student Śāntarakṣita) emphasized that we can distinguish between “true convention” (tathya-saṃvṛti) and “false convention” (mithyā-saṃvṛti).

In his refusal of the characteristically “Svātantrika” use of the conceptual tools of Buddhist epistemology, Candrakīrti need not be understood as conceding simply that anything goes. Candrakīrti’s point, rather, would seem to be to emphasize that there can be no explanatory categories that do not themselves exhibit the same characteristics (chiefly, the fact of being dependently originated) already on display in the conventionally described world; and any constitutively analytic sort of reasoning (such as that exemplified by the discourse of epistemology) just is a search for something beyond what is already given in conventional discourse. What is “conventionally” true, then, is (by definition) just our conventions – and any demand for some account or explanation of these could be thought to provide some purchase only to the extent that what is demanded is something that is not itself “conventional.” But there cannot be any such discourse, any more than there can be an existent that is not dependently originated; the two claims are related insofar as all that could count as a discursively exhaustive explanation would be one that adduces something that is not itself subject to the constraints that it explains – which is to say, something not dependently originated. Although this may represent an adequate reconstruction of his position, Candrakīrti’s emphasis on the definitively “non-analytic” character of conventional discourse can, nevertheless, reasonably be thought to leave his project vulnerable to charges of incoherence, and it can be seen that the issues in dispute between Svātantrikas and Prāsaṅgika are the same paradoxes that bedevil Madhyamaka more generally.

6. Madhyamaka in Tibet

Indian Madhyamaka figures decisively in most of the Tibetan schools of Buddhist philosophy, which tend to agree in judging Madhyamaka to represent the pinnacle of Buddhist thought. There are, however, interesting historical and philosophical developments that greatly complicate this picture. For example, while the scholastic traditions of Indian Buddhist philosophy were first introduced to Tibet by the “Svātantrika” Mādhyamikas Śāntarakṣita and Kamalaśīla, many schools of Tibetan Buddhism nevertheless claim Candrakīrti’s (“Prāsaṅgika”) interpretation as authoritative – a fact partly owing, perhaps, to the influence of Atiśa in the so-called “second dissemination” of Indian Buddhism to Tibet (that is, the period during which Indian Buddhism was decisively established in Tibet, and during which the systematic translation of Indian Buddhist texts into Tibetan was brought to fruition). However, the characteristically Tibetan emphasis on “Vajrayāna” (that is, tantric) forms of practice arguably promotes greater recourse to the idiom of Yogācāra than would be encouraged by Candrakīrti. In addition, there are, as noted, philosophical reasons for qualifying some of Candrakīrti’s positions. Hence, even those Tibetan schools (such as the dGe-lugs) that most forcefully assert the authoritative character of “Prāsaṅgika” Madhyamaka tend, for example, to support their interpretation with significant studies in the Buddhist epistemological tradition – a move, as noted, definitively characteristic of the “Svātantrika” approach.

The attempt thus to wed Madhyamaka to the philosophical project of Dignāga and Dharmakīrti is worth appreciating not only because it is intrinsically interesting, but because, particularly in the United States in the latter part of the 20th century, a great many modern interpreters of Indian Madhyamaka have been influenced by characteristically Tibetan appropriations of this tradition. While this has arguably led to some distortions in the exegesis particularly of Candrakīrti’s texts, there is much to recommend the Tibetans’ systematic (as opposed to historical) presentation of Madhyamaka in relation to the other schools of Indian Buddhist philosophy. As indicated, a distinctive feature of characteristically Tibetan presentations of Buddhist philosophy is the use of doxographical digests elaborating what are called “established conclusions” (grub mtha’; this translates the Sanskrit siddhānta).

On this model, the various schools of Indian Buddhist philosophy (principally consisting, according to such presentations, in the two “Ābhidharmika” schools of the Vaibhāṣikas and Sautrāntikas, and the two “Mahāyāna” schools of Yogācāra and Madhyamaka) are represented in an ascending hierarchy of progressively more refined positions, the proper understanding of each of which requires understanding its predecessors. Ascent through the hierarchy is characterized, most basically, by the progressive elimination of ontological commitments: the two Ābhidharmika schools divide over the question of what are to be admitted as “dharmas” qualifying for inclusion in a final ontology; Yogācāra further pares down this list to nothing but mental events; the “Svātantrika” Mādhyamikas are represented as retaining only the vestigial ontological commitments that are thought to be entailed by their characteristic deference to the dialectical tools of epistemology; until, with the “Prāsaṅgika” iteration of Madhyamaka, we arrive at the school of thought for which the set of “ultimately existent” (paramārthasat) phenomena is an empty set.

The effect of this is to throw our attention back to the only “set” of existents with any remaining content: the conventionally described world, now understood as ineliminable. Hence, on this view, there is the avoidance of (what Mādhyamikas are always trying to eschew) the extreme of nihilism or “eliminativism” (ucchedavāda); but there is also the (constitutively Buddhist) avoidance of the extreme of “eternalism,” insofar as the effect of cultivating the Mādhyamika insight only as the culminating stage in a progression is (it is claimed) to have driven home the realization that the self exists (like everything “conventional”) only relatively or dependently. Once the project of a privileged level of description has been abandoned, the “common-sense realism” that remains can be seen to differ from that of the unenlightened “by virtue of its being adopted in full cognizance of the progression through the intervening stages” (Siderits 2003, 185).

The same insight is reflected in the basic monastic curriculum of dGe-lugs-pa monasteries, which is structured around five topics defined by representative Indian texts: The Vinaya, or Buddhist monastic code, as represented by the Vinaya Sūtra of Guṇaprabha; Abhidharma, as represented by the Abhidharmakośa of Vasubandhu; logic and epistemology, as represented by the Pramāṇavārttika of Dharmakīrti; Madhyamaka, as represented by Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakāvatāra; and the stages on the path to enlightenment, as represented by the Abhisamayālaṃkāra attributed to Maitreya. In this way, the study of the Madhyamaka tradition of Buddhist philosophy comes only in the context of an overarching education in a complete Buddhist world-view, such that characteristically Mādhyamika teachings concerning “emptiness” are – like the Prajñāpāramitā Sūtras whose retrieval by Nāgārjuna was thought to introduce Mahāyāna as representing the Buddha’s definitive teaching – made intelligible by the necessarily propaedeutic earlier teachings. Above all, it is the finally ethical character of Mādhyamika thought that is encouraged by this pedagogical system; for the characteristically Mādhyamika claim that “all dharmas are empty” – that, in other words, Abhidharma’s reductionist account of the person cannot finally be made coherent – cannot be understood as nihilistic if it has been made clear that the upshot of it is to return our attention to the irreducibly conventional world in which persons live and suffer.

Tibetan tradition preserves, however, not only a model for the integration of Madhyamaka philosophy into a structured set of transformative religious practices, but also a great deal of innovative and sophisticated philosophical elaboration of Mādhyamika thought. For example, the prolific scholar Tsong-kha-pa (1357-1419) – originator of the influential reformist school that would style itself the “dGe-lugs” (“virtuous way”) – did much to integrate the Prāsaṅgika Madhyamaka of Candrakīrti with the understanding and teaching of Buddhist epistemology stemming from Dharmakīrti. Tsong-kha-pa’s works (such as the massive Lam rim chen mo, “Great [treatise on] the Stages of the Path”) also bring considerable sophistication to bear on the question of how Madhyamaka ought to be understood in relation to Yogācāra. Critics of Tsong-kha-pa – such as, notably, the Sa-skya-pa scholar Go-ram-pa bSod-nams seng-ge (1429-1489) – stridently condemned his confidence that the discourse of epistemology could bring Mādhyamika analysis into contact with ultimate reality. On Go-ram-pa’s reading, such confidence amounts to the claim that the discursive thought that understands “ultimate truth” is itself ultimately true – which is to confuse the (necessarily conventional) activity of thinking about ultimate truth with what it is that such thought is about. Go-ram-pa claims that Tsong-kha-pa’s account of Madhyamaka entails the nihilistic conclusion that what is ultimately true is simply what is conventionally true. This Tibetan debate, then, recognizably addresses the perennially vexed issues that go to the heart of Madhyamaka: those concerning how we are to understand the relation between ultimate and conventional truth, in the context of a claim to the effect that “the ultimate truth is that there is no ultimate truth.”

7. Madhyamaka in East Asia

It is frequently observed that while Indo-Tibetan schools of Buddhist philosophy characteristically developed around the systematic treatises (śāstras) of historical thinkers like Nāgārjuna and Dignāga, Chinese Buddhist philosophy instead centers on (and its schools are largely defined by) the interpretation of particular Buddhist sūtras. Whatever truth there may be in this, it is certainly the case that a great deal of systematic Indian Buddhist philosophy from the mature scholastic phase of the tradition (roughly, from the sixth century on) was never translated into Chinese. Although the texts of (say) Nāgārjuna, Vasubandhu, and Dignāga are available in Chinese translation, the Chinese canon does not include the works of such thinkers as Candrakīrti, Dharmakīrti, or Śāntarakṣita – the later Mādhyamikas and epistemologists whose works decisively shaped Indo-Tibetan traditions of interpretation. Accordingly, the development of Madhyamaka in China centers on a somewhat different group of texts – all of them translated by the great translator Kumārajīva (350-409), whose efforts figure prominently in the Chinese reception of Madhyamaka. So, the Chinese analogue of the Indian Madhyamaka school was originally styled San-lun, the “Three Śāstra” school, so called for its reliance upon three of Kumārajīva’s translations. Only one of these (the MMK, here called Chung lun, “Madhyamakaśāstra”; Taishō 1564) has an extant Sanskrit antecedent. The other two – the Dvādaśanikāyaśāstra (Shih erh men lun, Taishō 1568), attributed to Nāgārjuna, and the Śata[ka]śāstra (Pai lun, Taishō 1569), attributed to Āryadeva – are extant neither in Sanskrit nor in Tibetan translation.

It was, however, arguably another treatise attributed to Nāgārjuna (and also “translated” by Kumārajīva) that was ultimately to have greater influence on East Asian interpretations of Madhyamaka: the Ta-chih-tu lun, or *Mahāprajñāpāramitopadeśa Śāstra (“Treatise which is a Teaching on the Great Perfection of Wisdom [Sūtra]”). This text – a massive summa of Buddhist doctrine, comparable in scope to the *Vijñaptimātratāsiddhi (which is ostensibly a digest and compilation of several Indian commentaries on one of the works by Vasubandhu that is foundational for Yogācāra) – is extant in no other translation than Kumārajīva’s, and comprises a great deal of material that is not easily reconciled with what is taught in Nāgārjuna’s MMK. However, despite the scholarly consensus to the effect that this text is not authentically attributed to Nāgārjuna, East Asian authors citing Nāgārjuna tend most frequently to cite Kumārajīva’s text (and not the MMK). The reasons for this are, along with one of the salient features of characteristically East Asian interpretations of Nāgārjuna, reflected in a comment by the Japanese scholar Junjirō Takakusu, who observed that while such Mādhyamika texts as the MMK are “much inclined to be negativistic idealism,” in the Ta-chih-tu lun “we see that [Nāgārjuna] establishes his monistic view much more affirmatively than in any other text” (Takakusu 1949: 100).

Takakusu’s assessment of the MMK as “negativistic” arguably relates to the ways in which characteristically East Asian interpretations of Madhyamaka have been (not surprisingly) influenced by the vicissitudes of Chinese translations from Sanskrit. For example, it has been noted (by, e.g., Swanson 1989: 14) that Chinese terms centrally associated with the two truths – yu (“existence” or “being”) and wu (“non-existence” or non-being”), identified, respectively, with saṃvṛtisatya (conventional truth) and paramārthasatya (ultimate truth) – had strongly ontological implications that can alter the sense of characteristically Mādhyamika claims (originally stated in Sanskrit) when those were translated into Chinese. In particular, the ontologically “negative” sense of the term wu has arguably had the effect of recommending that Mādhyamika claims regarding emptiness be taken (notwithstanding Nāgārjuna’s repeated cautions in this regard) as rather more nihilistic than was intended.

We can consider, in this regard, chapter 24, verse 18 of Nāgārjuna’s MMK – a pivotal verse that may be rendered: “We call that which is dependent origination [pratītyasamutpāda] emptiness [śūnyatā]. That [emptiness,] a relative indication [upādāya prajñapti], is itself the middle path [madhyamā pratipad].” This often cited (and variously translated) verse is significant chiefly for its asserting that the authentic “middle path” – and hence (given the centrality of the middle way trope in Buddhist thought) the authentically Buddhist doctrine – lies in realizing the identity of three terms: dependent origination, emptiness, and “dependent designation” or “relative indication” (upādāya prajñapti). The semantic range of the latter term is such as to suggest that emptiness-cum-dependent origination is itself “conventional,” and one upshot of the verse is therefore to express, in effect, the idea of the “emptiness of emptiness.” More straightforwardly, though, this verse clearly represents one of the countless occasions on which Nāgārjuna is concerned to emphasize that by “emptiness” he means simply “dependent origination.”

On one characteristically East Asian interpretation of this verse (that of the modern Japanese scholar Gadjin Nagao), however, we are to understand here that the verse’s initial predication (“we call that which is dependent origination emptiness”) amounts to a negation of (the ontologically “positive” phenomenon which is) dependent origination. As Nagao states this idea, “This pratītya-samutpāda dies in the second [quarter verse].” The second predication – which characterizes this “emptiness” as a “relative indication” – then amounts to a return to the ontologically “positive.” On this reading, then, the verse “is dialectical, moving from affirmation to negation and again to affirmation.” (Nagao 1991: 193-94) This “dialectical” reading of a quintessentially Mādhyamika claim is frequently encountered in modern Japanese scholarship – a fact that arguably reflects the extent to which many Japanese scholars (even those who have developed deep acquaintance with the Sanskrit texts of Indian Buddhism) have their initial grounding in the characteristically East Asian traditions of interpretation in which the Ta-chih-tu lun of Kumārajīva is paramount.

Another characteristic preoccupation of East Asian interpreters of Madhyamaka is one also evident in some of the Indo-Tibetan traditions of interpretation: that of attempting to harmonize Madhyamaka and Yogācāra. In the East Asian case, the fact that so many Buddhist interpreters of Madhyamaka should attempt – notwithstanding the extent to which many Indian Mādhyamika and Yogācāra texts are framed as mutually polemical – to develop a synthesis of these two great schools of Mahāyāna philosophy partly reflects the predominance of Yogācāra in East Asian Buddhist thought. If, however, Madhyamaka philosophy was largely eclipsed by Yogācāra (and more importantly, by other indigenous developments) in the East Asian context, it nevertheless arguably lives on in the enigmatic discourse of Ch’an/Zen Buddhism that many take to be quintessentially East Asian. While any Mādhyamika influence on Zen is surely indirect, the latter tradition’s particular debt to the Prajñāpāramitā literature (the Vajracchedikā, or “Diamond,” Sūtra figures most importantly here) perhaps explains why many modern observers are inclined to see affinities with Madhyamaka.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ames, William L. 1986. “Buddhapālita’s Exposition of the Madhyamaka.” Journal of Indian Philosophy 14: 313-348.
  • Ames, William L. 1993-94. “Bhāvaviveka's Prajñāpradīpa: A Translation of Chapter One: ‘Examination of Causal Conditions’ (Pratyaya),” [in two parts], Journal of Indian Philosophy 21: 209-259; 22: 93-135.
    • These articles provide a good point of access to the interpretations of Nāgārjuna ventured by two of his earliest commentators (the two discussed at length in the commentary of Candrakīrti).
  • Arnold, Dan. 2005. Buddhists, Brahmins, and Belief: Epistemology in South Asian Philosophy of Religion. New York: Columbia University Press.
    • Part 3 of this work makes a case (based on an engagement with Candrakīrti’s critique of the Buddhist epistemologist Dignāga) for the interpretation of Madhyamaka as involving transcendental arguments.
  • Bhattacharya, Kamaleswar. 1990. The Dialectical Method of Nāgārjuna: Vigrahavyāvartanī. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
    • Contains (along with an edition of the Sanskrit text) a reliable translation of one of Nāgārjuna’s major works.
  • Blumenthal, James. 2004. The Ornament of the Middle Way: A Study of the Madhyamaka Thought of Śāntarakṣita. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion Publications.
    • A translation and extensive study (together with a translated dGe-lugs-pa commentary) of Śāntarakṣita’s Madhyamakālaṃkāra.
  • Burton, David F. 1999. Emptiness Appraised: A Critical Study of Nāgārjuna’s Philosophy. London: Curzon.
    • Argues that despite Nāgārjuna’s expressed intentions, his arguments entail nihilistic conclusions.
  • Cabezón, José Ignacio. 1992. A Dose of Emptiness: An Annotated Translation of the sTong thun chen mo of mKhas grub dGe legs dpal bzang. Albany: SUNY Press.
    • This extensively annotated and reliable translation makes available a representative example of a Tibetan dGe-lugs-pa interpretation of Madhyamaka (this one by one of Tsong-kha-pa’s two major disciples).
  • Chimpa, Lama, and Alaka Chattopadhyaya, trans. 1970. Tāranātha’s History of Buddhism in India. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
    • A useful translation of a traditional history of the Indian Buddhist tradition, containing representative accounts of the careers and works of important Indian thinkers.
  • Conze, Edward, trans. 1975. The Large Sutra on Perfect Wisdom, with the divisions of the Abhisamayālaṅkāra. Berkeley: University of California Press.
    • A useful point of access to the paradoxical style of discourse that is characteristic of the “Prajñāpāramitā” literature that figures in Nāgārjuna’s background.
  • Crosby, Kate, and Andrew Skilton, trans. 1995. The Bodhicaryāvatāra. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • A translation of the major work of Śāntideva, with an introduction and annotations.
  • Dreyfus, Georges. 2003. The Sound of Two Hands Clapping: The Education of a Tibetan Buddhist Monk. Berkeley: University of California Press.
    • An insightful study of the pedagogical context for the Tibetan interpretation and transmission of Madhyamaka.
  • Dreyfus, Georges, and Sara McClintock, eds. 2003. The Svātantrika-Prāsaṅgika Distinction: What Difference Does a Difference Make? Boston: Wisdom Publications.
    • A collection of scholarly essays representative of the current state of debate on this division of Madhyamaka, with attention both to this as a Tibetan doxographical category, and to matters of interpretation regarding the antecedent Indian texts.
  • Garfield, Jay L., trans. 1995. The Fundamental Wisdom of the Middle Way: Nāgārjuna’s Mūlamadhyamakakārikā. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Though translated from the Tibetan (and not from the extant Sanskrit), this is the most accessible of the available translations of Nāgārjuna’s foundational text – and far and away the most philosophically sophisticated and illuminating.
  • Hayes, Richard P. 1994. “Nāgārjuna’s Appeal.” Journal of Indian Philosophy 22: 299-378.
    • Argues that Nāgārjuna’s works centrally involve an equivocation on the word svabhāva.
  • Huntington, C. W., with Geshe Namgyal Wangchen. 1989. The Emptiness of Emptiness: An Introduction to Early Indian Mādhyamika. Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.
    • An annotated translation of Candrakīrti’s Madhyamakāvatāra, with a lengthy introduction that makes a case for the interpretation of Madhyamaka along lines suggested by poststructuralist philosophy.
  • Iida Shotaro. 1980. Reason and Emptiness: A Study in Logic and Mysticism. Tokyo: Hokuseido.
    • A study, with texts and translations, of major works of Bhāvaviveka.
  • Jha, Ganganath, trans. 1986. The Tattvasaṁgraha of Shāntarakṣita with the Commentary of Kamalashīla. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass. (Reprint; first published in Gaekwad’s Oriental Series, 1937-1939.)
    • A relatively inaccessible (but nonetheless complete) translation of this major work by Śāntarakṣita.
  • La Vallée Poussin, Louis de, ed. 1970. Mūlamadhyamakakārikās (Mādhyamikasūtras) de Nāgārjuna, avec la Prasannapadā Commentaire de Candrakīrti. Bibliotheca Buddhica, Vol. IV. Osnabrück: Biblio Verlag. (Reprint; originally published 1903-1913.)
    • This work warrants mention as the standard edition of the foundational text of Madhyamaka.
  • Lamotte, Etienne, trans. 1944-1980. Le Traité de la Grande Vertu de Sagesse. 5 volumes. Louvain: Insitut orientaliste, Bibliothèque de l’Université de Louvain.
    • The characteristically extensive annotations alone make this monumental work a treasure trove. Despite its vastness, this represents only a partial translation of the Ta-chih-tu Lun (*Mahāprajñāpārmitāśāstra) of Nāgārjuna/Kumārajīva.
  • Lang, Karen. 1986. Āryadeva’s Catuḥśataka: On the Bodhisattva's Cultivation of Merit and Knowledge. Copenhagen: Akademisk Forlag.
    • A reliable translation of the major work of Āryadeva.
  • Lindtner, Chr. 1987. Nagarjuniana: Studies in the Writings and Philosophy of Nāgārjuna. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1987. (Reprint; first published in Copenhagen, Institute for indisk filologi, 1982.)
    • A study of the works that are (and are not) appropriately attributed to Nāgārjuna, with editions and translations of several.
  • Murti, T. R. V. 1960. The Central Philosophy of Buddhism: A Study of the Mādhyamika System. Second edition. London: George Allen and Unwin.
    • An important early study of Madhyamaka, representing one of a few influential neo-Kantian interpretations thereof.
  • Nagao Gadjin. 1991. Mādhyamika and Yogācāra: A Study of Mahāyāna Philosophies. Trans. Leslie S. Kawamura. Albany: SUNY Press.
    • A selection of translated essays representative of the approach and legacy of this important Japanese scholar.
  • Ramanan, K. Venkata. 1975. Nāgārjuna’s Philosophy as presented in the Mahā-Prajñāpāramitā-Śāstra. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass. (Reprint; first published Charles Tuttle, 1966.)
    • This work is useful for its making accessible the contents and style of the text (extant only in Kumārajīva’s Chinese translation) that most influenced the East Asian reception of Madhyamaka. (Ramanan is in the scholarly minority in accepting the Chinese tradition’s attribution of the text to Nāgārjuna.)
  • Ruegg, David Seyfort. 1981. The Literature of the Madhyamaka School of Philosophy in India. A History of Indian Literature (ed. Jan Gonda), Vol. VII, Fasc. 1. Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
    • This authoritative work on the history and texts of Indian Madhyamaka is the standard reference work on the subject.
  • Siderits, Mark. 2003. Personal Identity and Buddhist Philosophy: Empty Persons. Burlington, VT: Ashgate.
    • Chapters 6-9 develop a sophisticated philosophical reconstruction of Madhyamaka (here characterized as a philosophically “anti-realist” position), which is represented as constitutively related to the reductionism of Ābhidharmika Buddhism (treated in the first half of the book). A difficult work that can seem to owe more to analytic philosophy than to Indian Buddhism, but an exceptionally sensitive account of the issue of truth vis-à-vis Madhyamaka. In particular, Siderits argues for a version of Madhyamaka as involving a “deflationist” account of truth (here called “semantic non-dualism”).
  • Sopa, Geshe Lhundup, and Jeffrey Hopkins, trans., Cutting Through Appearances: The Practice and Theory of Tibetan Buddhism. 2nd ed. Ithaca, NY: Snow Lion Publications, 1989.
    • Includes a somewhat inaccessible translation of a standard Tibetan doxographical text, which is useful for a sense of how Madhyamaka is represented by Tibetans in relation to other Buddhist schools of thought.
  • Sprung, Mervyn, trans. 1979. Lucid Exposition of the Middle Way: The Essential Chapters from the Prasannapadā of Candrakīrti. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Currently the closest thing to a complete Western-language translation of Candrakīrti’s text (hence, the translation also comprises most of Nāgārjuna’s MMK). While not an altogether reliable translation, this provides some access to the discourse of Candrakīrti.
  • Stcherbatsky, Th. 1927. The Conception of Buddhist Nirvāṇa. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1989. (Reprint.)
    • This early work includes a dated and eccentric (but nonetheless useful) translation of the first chapter of Candrakīrti’s Prasannapadā. Stcherbatsky influentially advanced a broadly neo-Kantian interpretation of Madhyamaka.
  • Swanson, Paul L. 1989. Foundations of T’ien-T’ai Philosophy: The Flowering of the Two Truths Theory in Chinese Buddhism. Berkeley: Asian Humanities Press.
    • An accessible study of the East Asian reception and interpretation of Madhyamaka.
  • Takakusu Junjirō. 1949. The Essentials of Buddhist Philosophy. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1975. (Reprint; first published by the University of Hawaii.)
    • A concise presentation of the various schools of Buddhist philosophy as they are reckoned in East Asian traditions. The presentation of Madhyamaka (“Sanron,” the “Three Treatise” school) is at pp.99-111.
  • Thurman, Robert. 1991. The Central Philosophy of Tibet: A Study and Translation of Jey Tsong Khapa’s Essence of True Eloquence. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
    • A translation of part of an important work by Tsong-kha-pa, representing a Tibetan Mādhyamika engagement with Yogācāra. The author’s lengthy introduction advances a broadly Wittgensteinian understanding of Madhyamaka.
  • Tillemans, Tom J. F. 1990. Materials for the Study of Āryadeva, Dharmapāla and Candrakīrti. Wiener Studien zur Tibetologie und Buddhismuskunde, Heft 24, 1-2. Wien: Arbeitskreis für tibetische und buddhistische Studien.
    • Annotated translations (with a philosophically sophisticated introduction and annotations) of parts of the divergent commentaries on Āryadeva by the Mādhyamika Candrakīrti and the Yogācārin Dharmapāla.
  • Tuck, Andrew. 1990. Comparative Philosophy and the Philosophy of Scholarship: On the Western Interpretation of Nāgārjuna. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • An illuminating study of the philosophical presuppositions informing important modern interpretations of Nāgārjuna.
  • Walser, Joseph. 2005. Nāgārjuna in Context: Mahāyāna Buddhism and Early Indian Culture. New York: Columbia University Press.
    • An attempt to locate the figure of Nāgārjuna in socio-historical context (and particularly in relation to the then nascent Mahāyāna movement).
  • Williams, Paul. 1989. Mahāyāna Buddhism: The Doctrinal Foundations. London: Routledge.
    • An accessible and lucid survey of Mahāyāna Buddhist thought. Chapter 3 treats Madhyamaka, with some attention to Tibetan and East Asian developments therein.

Author Information

Dan Arnold
University of Chicago Divinity School
U. S. A.

Non-Cognitivism in Ethics

Non-Cognitivism in Ethics

A non-cognitivist theory of ethics implies that ethical sentences are neither true nor false, that is, they lack truth-values. What this means will be investigated by giving a brief logical-linguistic analysis explaining the different illocutionary senses of normative sentences. The analysis will make sense of how normative sentences play their proper role even though they lack truth values, a fact which is hidden by the ambiguous use of those sentences in our language. The main body of the article explores various non-cognitivist logics of norms from the early attempts by Hare and Stevenson to the more recent ones by A. Gibbard and S. Blackburn. Jorgensen’s Dilemma and the Frege-Geach Problem are two important aspects of this logic of norms. Jorgensen’s Dilemma is the problem in the philosophy of law of inferring normative sentences from normative sentences, which is an apparent problem because inferences are typically understood as involving sentences with truth values. The Frege-Geach Problem is a problem in moral philosophy involving inferences in embedded contexts or in illocutionary mixed sentences. The article ends with a taxonomy of non-cognitivist theories. See also Ethical Expressivism.

Table of Contents

  1. Metaethical assumptions
    1. Different illocutionary acts
    2. Difference between language and metalanguage
    3. Ambiguity of normative sentences
    4. Definitions of ethical non-cognitivism
  2. The problem of a logic of norms
    1. Jorgensen’s dilemma: its importance for non-cognitivism
  3. From earlier non-cognitivism to the “new norm-expressivism”
    1. C. L. Stevenson and the role of persuasion
    2. R. M. Hare and the dictive indifference of logic
    3. The new “norm-expressivism”
  4. The Frege-Geach Problem
    1. Blackburn solutions to the Frege-Geach Problem
    2. Gibbard solution to the Frege-Geach Problem
  5. The significance of the Geach-Frege Problem and Jorgensen’s Dilemma for non-cognitivism
  6. A Taxonomy of Ethics
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Metaethical assumptions

In this section, we will introduce some preliminary linguistic notions that will allow us to give a better account of the cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism divide.

Canonically, forms of language are mainly divided in two species: cognitive sentences (cognitive use of language) and non-cognitive sentences (instrumental use of language). Cognitive sentences are fact-dependent or bear truth-values, while non-cognitive sentences are, on the contrary, fact independent and do not bear truth-values.

Cognitive sentences typically describe states of affairs, such as “The earth is square” or “Schwarzenegger won the last California election;” such sentences are verifiable and can be either true or false. On the other hand, sentences such as “You shall not steal,, “You ought to pay your taxes,” and “Don’t shut the door, please,” do not describe states of affairs nor can be understood as carrying falsehood or truth, but they rather have a different kind of illocutionary force.

a. Different illocutionary acts

Before introducing the notion of illocutionary force, we need to say more about language and its usage. The basic part of a language carrying meaning is called a sentence, such as “The actual king of France is bald” or “Close that door, please!” Thereby, a speaker’s actual empirical performance (here and now) of an actual linguistic expression is not mentioned. We are rather referring to a class including all the possible empirical performances made by a possible speaker in any language and in any occurrence of that determined expression. On the other hand, propositions are the meaning of sentences: they are true or false, they can be known, believed or doubted and, finally, they are kept constant in respect of their translation from a language to another (Lyons, 1995, p. 141).

The same proposition may be used in different occurrences for doing different things. In other words, the same proposition can be used for asserting, questioning, asking, demanding and so on. A sentence, therefore, can be understood as an illocutionary act. The general form of illocutionary acts, according to Searle, is:


where “F” stands for any indicator of illocutionary force, and “p” takes expressions for propositions. In this way, we can symbolize different kinds of illocutionary acts such as assertions:

├ p      such as in “You are going to shut the door”


!p        such as in “Shut the door!”

or questions:

?p        such as in “Are you going to shut the door?”

According to Reichenbach (1947, p. 337), illocutionary acts are not true or false. They are indeed instruments constructed with the help of propositions, and therefore they belong to language; this is what distinguishes them from other instruments devised to reach a certain aim. We can distinguish two – not necessarily separated - elements within an illocutionary act, namely the propositional indicator (p) and the indicator of illocutionary force (F). What is called propositional content (or proposition, or radical-proposition) is symbolized with “p” and it is the invariant ingredient in an illocutionary act (in our example above is: “your going to shut the door” or the possible state of affair “you are going to shut the door”). Indeed, it describes the “descriptive content” of a sentence; or, in other words, it stands for a possible state of affair containing meaning and, consequently, having truth-values.

On the contrary, illocutionary acts show the way a proposition is used or what illocutionary force the sentence belongs to. Therefore, illocutionary force has no semantic meaning whatsoever and so it does not form part, for example, of the conceptual amount of a norm sentence. Importantly, illocutionary forces are not alethic modalities-like (such as “is necessary that”); they are not like intensional operators and therefore they cannot be used for creating propositions starting from propositions. For this reason Frege’s Rule states signs of illocutionary force cannot (a) being iterated and (b) fall under the range of propositional connectives.

Finally, the illocutionary dimension has a perlocutionary element attached. According to Levinson (1983, p. 237), a perlocutionary act is specific to the circumstances of issuance and is therefore not conventionally achieved just by uttering that particular utterance, and includes all those effects, intended or unintended, often indeterminate, that some particular utterance in a particular situation may cause. The main difference between a perlocutionary act and an illocutionary act stands on the fact that the former has a conventional nature, as it can be represented in explicit form using the performative formula; this conventional nature does not apply to perlocutionary act. In the following, we will see the importance of perlocutionary acts within the emotive theories of ethics, which represent a kind of non-cognitivist theory.

b. Difference between language and metalanguage

Another fundamental notion to understand is considering the difference between cognitivism and non-cognitivism concerns a linguistic difference between language and meta-language. This distinction makes clear another problematic feature intrinsic to the ordinary use of natural languages such as the ambiguity of normative sentences and prescriptions. Often non-cognitivist positions are confused with relativistic positions because of the shift from the object language into the meta-language. When we say, “Hitler was a bad leader,” we are uttering a normative sentence. When we say, “Winston said Hitler was a bad leader” we are not uttering a normative although relativistic sentence. Rather we are moving from the object-language (that is the sentence “Hitler was a bad leader”) to a meta-linguistic one (that is “Winston said Hitler was a bad leader”) which is typically a descriptive sentence (taken as a whole) talking about a normative sentence (that is: “Hitler was a bad leader”). There is no room for relativism here: the latter is not a moral sentence but simply a descriptive sentence (or, following Max Weber, a sociological sentence), which, according to B. Russell (1935, p. 214-215), belongs to psychology or biography. An important feature of descriptive sentences holds that “The descriptive sentences of obligation and permission are relative in a sense in which the prescriptive sentences are not”; they always refer to the utterer/authority of that sentence (that in our case is Winston): “conceptually, the reference to the authority is necessary to identify the normative proposition [that is “Hitler was a bad leader”] expressed by a normative sentence used in a descriptive way” (Alchourrón, 1993)

c. Ambiguity of normative sentences

Notice that normative sentences are ambiguous; they can be uttered both in descriptive and in normative ways at the level of common language. In other words, the same normative sentence can be used either to perform prescriptions as well as to describe that a particular norm exists. Jeremy Bentham (1970, p. 104; Bentham, 1789, chap. XVII, § XXIX n.1; see Alchourron and Bulygin, 1989 and Bulygin, 1982) was intuitively aware of ambiguity in normative sentences. In fact, this semantical shift is due to a peculiar capacity of natural languages to mix up the language level with meta-language level to the extent in which we cannot appreciate any difference between them when using ordinary language. According to Bentham, on the contrary, such a linguistic difference should be clear; in fact he pointed out that “The property and very essence of law, it may be said, is to command; the language of the law then should be the language of command. For expressing commands there is in all languages a particular mood, which is styled the imperative” (Bentham, 1970, p. 105). Bentham also argues that “There is still enough that serves, and that as effectually as in the other case, to distinguish the imperative from the ordinary didactic, narrative, informative or assertive style: the language of the will from the language of the understanding” (ibid.). This distinction is very important in the practice of law and in the field of ethics because “What is been termed a declaratory law, so far as it stands distinguished from either a coercive or a discoercive law, is not properly speaking a law. It is not the expression of an act of will exercised at the time: it is a mere notification of the existence of a law, either of the coercive or the discoercive kind, as already subsisting; of the existence of some document expressive of some act of will, exercised, not at the time, but at some former period” (Bentham, 1789, p.).

More recently, von Wright made that intuition more precise, explaining, “Tokens of the same sentences are used, sometimes to enunciate a prescription (that is, to enjoin, permit, or prohibit a certain action), sometimes again to express a proposition to the effect that there is a prescription enjoining, or permitting or prohibiting a certain action. Such propositions are called norm-propositions [or descriptive sentences of norms]” (von Wright, 1963, p. viii). Norms “should be carefully distinguished from ‘normative propositions’, i.e. descriptive propositions stating that ‘p’ is obligatory (forbidden or permitted) according to some unspecified norm or set of norms. Normative propositions - which can be regarded as propositions about sets (systems) of norms - also contain normative terms like ‘obligatory’, ‘prohibited’, etc. but these have a purely descriptive meaning” (Alchourrón e Bulygin, 1981).

The most influential analysis on the nature of normative sentences (especially in the field of philosophy of law) was carried out by Hans Kelsen (especially in Kelsen, 1941).

d. Definitions of ethical non-cognitivism

Ethical non-cognitivism claims that prescriptions have a different nature than descriptive sentences; they have no truth-values, they are not describing anything, and they have a different illocutionary role. That is to say, they do not express factual claims or beliefs and therefore are neither true nor false (they are not truth-apt); they belong to a different illocutionary force, the prescriptive mood.

These theories, as opposed to cognitivist theories, are not holding that ethical sentences are objectively and consistently true or false, neither even presupposing new entities platonic-like (in the way naturalistic theories do), and therefore they do not need to explain the way in which we can epistemically access these theories (see Blackburn, 1984, p. 169 and Hale, 1993). In other words, non-cognitivism claims that the principal feature of normative sentences (their lacking of truth values) is a consequence of the illocutionary role of such sentences. In fact, these sentences are not bearing any cognitive meaning (such as assertions or descriptions), but they are just used to utter prescriptions.

Therefore, cognitivist theories reject three traditional theses: (1) Hume’s Law (that is the claims that a moral conclusion cannot be validly inferred from non-moral premises), as some cognitivist theories suppress the distinction between cognitive and normative sentences; (2) Ockham’s Razor, because some of cognitivist theories do multiply entities without necessity, as they presuppose a (platonic) realm of norms; and (3) Jorgensen’s Dilemma (see below).

Non-cognitivist theories do not infringe Ockham’s Razor as they are not implying any platonic entity (we saw the difference between normative sentences and descriptive sentences is just at the illocutionary level) and they accept the challenge of Hume’s Law.

We can find two main theories within noncognitivism: emotivism and prescriptivism. These two theories, often confused, need to be carefully distinguished. Indeed emotivism and prescriptivism are different for two main reasons; for emotivists a normative sentence is basically a sentence which expresses a speaker’s feeling (such as “Gasp!”). For prescriptivists a normative sentence is used for uttering overriding universalizable prescriptions (such us: “You shalt not steal!”). Another difference between those two theories is about the possibility of a genuine logic of norms. Emotivists, at least in classical formulations (from Ayer to Stevenson) claim a logic of norms is very problematic or even impossible to build: while for prescriptivists (in particular in Hare’s theory or in von Wright’s works) the possibility for a logic of norms is open, although problematic.

2. The problem of a logic of norms

The main challenge non-cognitivist theories face is about the possibility of a logic of norms. Cognitivist theories are not facing this dilemma as they claim there is no difference between normative and descriptive sentences; therefore the classic logic based on truth-values is sufficient for normative reasoning. What about norms lacking truth-values?

The problem of a logic of norms is a vexata quaestio that dates back, in modern times, to Language, Truth and Logic by A.J. Ayer (1936). Ayer claimed that ethical sentences are pseudo concepts aimed at expressing emotions or commands having no real meaning. The only purpose of ethical sentences is to persuade the listener to act in a certain way. In other words, ethical sentences have only a perlocutory function. Therefore it is no possible to talk about disagreement and unsoundness in ethics; neither is it possible to speak about ethical reasoning because ethical sentences such as “parsimony is a virtue” and “parsimony is a vice” are not expressing propositions (that is are not true or false). Thus they can’t be incompatible. On the other hand, Ayer acknowledged that people do discuss about questions regarding values, but they are not actually ethical dilemmas involving values but factual questions. In fact, people, according to Ayer, reason about empirical facts on which state of affairs to perform and not about agreeing on an ethical belief.

According to M. Warnock (1978) Ayer’s is a negative theory of ethics because it lacks of meaning and scientific basis. The last word in ethics is rather ideological, that is to state the superiority of a moral system over another. Ayer’s skeptical conclusion is a consequence of the linguistic model he adopted (that is basically Wittgenstein’s Tractatus picture-theory, 1922). In fact, Ayer is not able (at least in Language Truth and Logic) to distinguish in normative sentences between an emotive (perlocutionary) part and a descriptive (meaning) part. The distinction is necessary to give ethics its full significance back.

Two years after Ayer’s Language, Truth and Logic, another author dealt with the problem of the foundation of a logic of norms. Jorgen Jorgensen (in “Imperativer og Logik”, 1937-38) claimed that “any imperative sentences may be considered as containing two factors which I may call the imperative factor and the indicative factor, the first indicating that some thing is commanded or wished and the latter describing what it is that is commanded or wished.” In an actual sentence it is not possible to distinguish between those two factors because a command void of content is impossible; but the indicative factor can be kept apart from the imperative mood and it can be used to express indicative sentences describing the action, changes or state of affairs which can be ordered or wished. For example, in the imperative “Close the door!” somebody is ordering that a door be closed. The order is that the proposition “the door once open is now closed” be true. Methodologically, Jorgensen was in line with the modern distinction in sentences between illocutionary force and propositional content (see i.e. Searle, 1969).

Jorgensen concluded, “it seems to be a syntactical rule that from an imperative sentence of the form “Do so and so,” an indicative sentence of the form “This is so and so” may be derived.” In other words, Jorgensen claimed imperative sentences can be transformed in indicative sentences in two ways: (1) the imperative factor is put outside the brackets much as the assertion sign in the ordinary logic and the logical operations are only performed within the brackets; or (2) for each imperative sentences there is an equivalent indicative sentence which is derived from the former. This derived indicative sentence applies to the rules of classical logic and thereby indirectly applies the rules of logic to the imperative sentences so that entailments of the latter may be made explicit.

Jorgensen’s first solution acknowledges the application of logic only within the propositional content (or indicative factor) without using the normative (or imperative) constituent. This solution is very similar to R.M. Hare’s dictive indifference of logic (Hare, 1949 and 1952) in which, we will see, logic is valid only at the phrastics level. Jorgensen’s second solution, on the other hand, seems to propose that normative sentences and descriptive sentences are linked through an isomorphic relation; that is prescriptions hold as the same logical rules as their descriptive counterparts. G.H. von Wright (1963) will successively explore this solution. Therefore Jorgensen, differently from Ayer, moved to an idea of ethics, which is called moderate emotivism close to Stevenson’s (1944) and Hare’s (1949). In fact, Jorgensen acknowledges a descriptive component within prescriptive sentences and also he thinks that it is possible to apply logic to norms.

a. Jorgensen’s dilemma: its importance for non-cognitivism

More importantly, Jorgensen proposed the so-called Jorgensen’s Dilemma, which is the first attempt to analyze the problem of the inference of norms (prescriptive sentences) from norms (prescriptive sentences) moving from the point that norms (prescriptive sentences) are lacking of truth-values. In fact, Jorgensen analyzes this problem moving from the so-called Poincare’s argument (a variant of Hume’s Law) in which is studied the role of logical inference into prescriptive contexts (that are lacking of truth-values). Jorgensen still thinks logical inference is a concept linked to a classical idea of logic, where an inference is when we get true conclusions starting from true premises. However Jorgensen noticed that in ordinary normative reasoning we perform inferences can be accepted as true; such as:

1.Keep your promises
2.This is a promise of yours
├ Therefore, keep this promise

Where at least one of the premises (in our case the premise 1.) is prescriptive. Hence, Jorgensen finds himself in front of the following “puzzle”:

“According to a generally accepted definition of logical inferences only sentences which are capable of being true or false can function as premises or conclusion in a inference; nevertheless it seems evident that a conclusion in the imperative mood may be drawn from two premises one of which or both of which are in the imperative mood” (Jorgensen, 1937-38).

There are two ways to explain this phenomenon: widening the notion of logic inference beyond the "mere" sphere of truth, or bypassing this distinction by using descriptive sentences equivalent to prescriptive sentences and applying them to the classical notion of logic inference. Otherwise it is not possible to apply the notion of logical inference to norms: any normative discourse turns to be illogical (as Ayer claimed).

The essence of the challenge of non-cognitivism is therefore expressed: how is possible to apply the notion of logical inference whatsoever to the realm of sentences lacking of truth-values?

3. From earlier non-cognitivism to the “new norm-expressivism”

If we believe norms are lacking of truth-values but a logic of norms is possible, we are thinking about an objectivist and non-cognitivist theory of norms, such as Hare’s; while if we believe that logical inference cannot be applied to sentences lacking of truth-values, therefore we have a non-cognitivist and subjectivist theory of norms, such as Ayer’s.

a. C. L. Stevenson and the role of persuasion

C. L. Stevenson (1944) developed another non-cognitivist and subjectivist theory of norms. Stevenson acknowledges that in moral sentences there is a descriptive component, which has no cognitive function but rather a quasi-imperative force which, operating through suggestion and intensified by your tone of voice, readily permits you to begin to influence or to modify another person’s behavior. Therefore, according to Stevenson, ethical terms are instruments used in a cooperative enterprise that leads to a mutual readjustment of human interest. So, when using ethical sentences, we are not using logical inference, but, actually, we are using methods of persuasion. According to Hare (1987), Stevenson treated what were perlocutionary features of moral language as if they were constitutive of its meaning, and as a result became an irrationalist, because perlocutionary acts are not subject to logical rules.

b. R. M. Hare and the dictive indifference of logic

According to Hare, normative sentences are characterized by three ingredients: prescriptivity, universalizability and overridingness/supervenience; these three ingredients are logical characteristics of normative sentences by virtue of their meaning (Hare, 1989).

According to Hare, moral sentences are prescriptions that are sentences used for guiding an action or to reply at the question: “What shall I do?” (Hare, 1952). In other words, an indicative (or descriptive) sentence is used for telling someone that something is the case; an imperative is not about that – it is used for telling someone to make something the case (ibid.). Differently from emotive theories (such as Stevenson’s), Hare claims that telling someone to make something the case implies a persuasive process from the speaker to the listener. Emotive theories, according to Hare, judge the success of imperative solely by their effects, that is, by whether the person believes or does what we are trying to get him or her to believe or do. It does not matter whether the means used to persuade him are fair or foul, so long as they persuade him/her. Persuasions imply a lack of rationality by moral theories; therefore using persuasion does not mean rationally replying to the question “What shall I do?”, but rather it is an attempt to answer the question in a particular way.

Universalizability is a feature moral sentences share with descriptions, but, according to Hare still is a logic component of neustics (Hare’s term for descriptive component of a sentence). Roughly speaking it means that terms like “ought” and “must” are similar to words like “all” rather than “red” or “blue”. In other words, normative concepts have to be compared to logical operators (such as “all” or “some” or “It is necessary that”) and not to predicates (see Hare, 1963 and 1967). Moreover, the rules that define their logical behavior make them universalizable. Another interpretation of the thesis of Universalizability claims that Universalizability is not about the way moral terms function, but it is a principle (axiom) which is part of any possible normative system as such (see Hare, 1982). In other words, Universalizability is similar to the “Golden Rule” (“Treat others only in a way that you’re willing to be treated in the same situation”) or to impartiality, rather than an actual formal axiom in a ethical system. This thesis has been attacked by several authors such as A. MacIntyre (1957), B. Williams (1985) and M. Singer (1985). All those scholars agree that actually there are several levels of universalizability which Hare’s monolithical formulation would melt. Particularly, MacIntyre argues that Hare does not make clear between “generality” (that is general principles) and “universality” (universal principles).

Supervenience is a feature moral sentences share with descriptions too. This issue is discussed also in the philosophy of mind. In moral philosophy, the issue of supervenience concerns the relationship which is said to hold between moral properties and natural or non-moral properties. Alternatively, it is put forward as a claim about a certain feature of moral terms or moral predicates. When it is said of “trust” that it is, say, good, “trust” is good because or in virtue of some subjacent or underlying property of it. Generally, it is held that these subjacent properties are natural properties of “trust”.

For Hare overridingness is a feature, not just of evaluative words, properties, or judgments, but of the wider class of judgments which have to have, at least in some minimal sense, reasons or grounds of explanations (Hare, 1989). Basically, Hare believes that overridingness and universalizability are similar concepts in that both involve a universal premise such as in the Golden Rule.

From a logical-linguistic point of view, Hare distinguishes in a sentence between a phrastic and a neustic:

“I shall call the part of the sentence that is common to [assertive and imperative] moods (…) the phrastic; and the part different in the case of commands and sentences (…) the neustic” (Hare, 1952).

Roughly speaking, a phrastic is that component in the sentence we called the descriptive component above, and a neustic is the illocutionary part in a sentence. According to Hare, logical connectives are part of phrastics; combinations of those connectives are able to create, are valid in the case we deal with normative sentences as well as we deal with descriptive sentences. It is, indeed, the proper function of these connectives to establish relations between sentences; in other words, the validity of a reasoning depends upon the logical links subsisting among phrastics. Hare’s thesis is called “dictive indifference of logic”: “we shall see (…) that these connectives are all descriptive and not dictive. In fact, it is the descriptive part of sentences with which formal logicians are almost exclusively concerned; and this means that what they say applied as much to imperatives as to indicatives; for to any descriptor (or phrastic) we can add either kind of dictor (or neustic), and get a sentence” (Hare, 1949). Therefore no difference will subsist between a logic of imperatives and a logic of assertions: “The method of reasoning used in (…) [imperative] inferences is, of course, exactly which is used in indicative logic: these considerations in no way support that there can be a separate ‘Logic of Imperatives’, but only that imperatives are logical in the same way as indicatives” (Ibid.). Phrastics, indeed, are the same in imperatives and assertions, and we can assert “that any formula of formal logic which is capable of an indicative interpretation is capable also of an imperative one,” that is, we can substitute an indicative neustic with an imperative one, leaving the phrastic unchanged (Ibid.).

c. The new “norm-expressivism”

Starting from the 80s there was a renewal of analysis of morals in an emotivist key. These analyses were made by Simon Blackburn and by Allan Gibbard. In their work the emotive theory of morals is revised and enriched even accepting room for a logic of norms (in opposition to what happened in the earlier emotive theories, such as Stevenson’s).

Blackburn’s quasi-realism (1984) moves from the actual practice in the ordinary language to express itself in a realistic way even when uttering moral sentences. Blackburn claims that practice is to be, so to speak, the way we made projections of our attitudes onto the world; in Blackburn’s own words, “we say we project an attitude or habit, or other commitment which is not descriptive onto the world, when we speak and think as though there were a property of things which our saying describe, which we can reason about, know about, be wrong about and so on” (Blackburn, ibid.).

Blackburn, on one hand, rehabilitates emotive theories of morals and, on the other hand, says – contrary to Mackie’s error theory – our use of realist terminology is respectable and not in contract with its projective origin. We will see in the next section how Blackburn can make room for a logic of norms.

Gibbard’s (1990) central concept is the idea that calling something rational is to express one’s acceptance of norms that permits it. It applies to the rationality of actions, and it applied to the rationality of beliefs and feelings (ibid.). For Gibbard, cognitive analyses fail to recognize that judging a behavior as rational means to endorse it; even classical non-cognitivist analyses fails this point as they admit that moral judgment are not feelings, but judgments of what moral feelings it is rational to have. Feelings we think, can be apt or not, moral judgments are judgments of when guilt and resentment are apt.

The primary function of norms (which Gibbard justifies on evolutionary basis) is to facilitate the social cooperation, and while true factual sentences are coupled with world representations, normative ones have the function of making social cooperation stable, and not linked to environmental and social changes. Gibbard’s theory is a non-cognitivist but naturalistic one, which is necessary to give an account of rationality in terms of accepting a norm which is, in its turn, a standard for rationality of actions; on the contrary it would turn in a vicious circle.

Norms rule everybody’s feelings and actions and they are the main component of a moral judgment; to judging an action as wrong, in Gibbard’s terms, it means that an actor’s feelings of guilt and judging people’s anger are apt feelings. Of course, these will be changing from culture to culture. Finally, Gibbard suggests that normative judgments – because their social function – commit us to adopt higher level norms to encourage social cooperation.

Gibbard’s key concept is “accepting a norm” which is to justify on a psychological theory of meaning in a similar way to Stevenson’s theory. For Gibbard, a norm is a significant kind of a psychological state of the mind, which is not fully understandable for us. Therefore, Gibbard’s theory rests on an ambiguity; on one hand, value judgments are lacking of truth-values, but on the other hand, they express the existence of someone’s mental states.

4. The Frege-Geach Problem

The Frege-Geach problem (also known as the “embedding problem”) is used as the main “test” to understand rationality in non-cognitivist theories. The problem was posed in P. Geach’s article “Assertion” (Geach, 1964), but the discussion starts back from Geach’s article “Imperatives and Deontic Logic” (Geach, 1958). In particular, Geach used his own test to attack non-cognitivist claims; in fact, if we find a positive solution to the Geach-Frege Problem we are de facto giving significance to non-cognitivist moral reasoning. On the contrary, if no solution to the problem is provided, the only option left open to moral reasoning is cognitivism or excluding ethics into the realm of rationality (likewise radical forms of emotivism such as Ayer).

Briefly, the Frege-Geach problem is that sentences that express moral judgments can form part of semantically complex sentences in a way that an expressivist cannot easily explain. According to Geach, the sentence “Telling the lies is wrong” has the same meaning regardless of whether it occurs on its own or as the antecedent of “If telling the lies is wrong, then getting your little brother to tell lies is also wrong”. This must be so, since we may derive “Telling your little brother to tell lies is wrong” from them and both by modus ponens without any fallacy of equivocation. Yet nothing is expressed (in the relevant sense) by “Telling lies is wrong” when it forms the antecedent of the conditional, since the antecedent is not itself the same illocutionary force as the premise, and so its meaning (regardless of where it occurs) apparently cannot be explained by an expressivist analysis. Analogous problems within other kinds of embedded contexts (Unwin, 1999).

However, Geach recommends attention to Frege’s distinction between assertion and predication, or in other words, between illocutionary force and propositional content, respectively. In fact, if we assume the role of the illocutionary force, there would be a slight change in the meaning of the word “wrong” in the antecedent of the conditional “If telling the lies is wrong, then getting your little brother to tell lies is also wrong” and in its occurrence as consequence in the same conditional sentence. This problem is even clearer using modus ponens:

1. If tormenting the cat is wrong, then getting your little brother to torment the cat is also wrong
2. Tormenting the cat is wrong
Therefore, getting your little brother to torment the cat is wrong.

In the case above it is difficult to say that the occurrence of “wrong” as antecedent of the 1st conditional (which appears to be descriptive) has exactly the same meaning as “wrong” in the 2nd sentence (which appears to be normative).

We saw non-cognitivism is characterized by the assumption that norms lack truth-values. Yet, the contexts introduced by ordinary logic operators such as “and”, “not”, “or”, “if… then”, and the quantifiers, together with predication itself, are normally explicated in terms of the more basic semantic concepts of truth. Therefore, it seems that this option is not available to non-cognitivists, in general, and in particular to expressivists.

a. Blackburn solutions to the Frege-Geach Problem

S. Blackburn (1984) redefines the Frege-Geach Problem in terms of whether expressive theories can cope with unasserted contexts in such a way as to allow sentences the same meaning within them, as they have when they are asserted. According to Blackburn, we use evaluative sentences as if they were not different from assertions (because of our projective attitude), and, therefore, we intuitively treat them as if they were bearing truth-values and linked to descriptive sentences.

The problem will be about the interpretation of connectives to be used to build up more complex commitments having in their own several illocutionary characteristics (such as in a conditional). Blackburn suggests commitments are used to create more complex sentences which is accepted only if all its parts are accepted, according to the following solution: “the notion of commitment is then capacious enough to include both ordinary beliefs, and these other attitudes, habits and prescriptions” (Blackburn, ibid., p. 192). Therefore a conditional will express someone’s endorsement to an attitude (which is an expression of a moral standpoint, too) preceded by a belief. In other words, it expresses a higher-order attitude, that is, an expression of disapproval or approval toward a combination of attitudes (such as of lying). Conditionals, as they are used in ordinary language, show the way we express an endorsement over involvement of commitments – which is expression of a moral standpoint. In other words, we can see that using conditional forms (in normative contexts) is a higher level form (compared to simple sentences like “it’s wrong telling lies”) which serves to express one’s attitudes on attitudes, or meta-attitudes.

Blackburn introduces these kinds of sentences formally in the following way:

(a) H! (B!p → B!q)

Where H! stands for the “Hooray” operator (expressive counterpart of the deontic operator “O” - for obligation), B! is the “Booh” operator (expressive equivalent to the deontic “F” - for forbidden). What appears between slashes shows that our argument is an attitude or a belief, which express a first order attitude (such as “The playing for West Ham is wrong”).

The main limit of Blackburn’s solution of the Frege-Geach problem concerns the nature of the H! and B! operators, while iterated in a higher order sentence. Blackburn’s formulation does not make clear the illocutionary role of the operator. If we interpret all the operators in the formula (a) in an expressive (or prescriptive) way, (that is lacking of truth-values), the whole expression will not make sense. According to Barcan Marcus (1966), iteration of normative operators looks like stammering. Otherwise. if we interpret (according to Blackburn) the external operator H! in an expressive (or prescriptive) way and those into the slashes as descriptive ones, we will have a correct way of interpreting operators but no solution to the Frege-Geach problem. The formula (a) above, indeed, is formally correct but does not solve the problem about the identity of meaning for example between the antecedent of the 1st conditional in the Modus Ponens shown above (which is descriptive) and its 2nd sentence (which is normative).

b. Gibbard solution to the Frege-Geach Problem

Gibbard tries to solve the Frege-Geach problem using a slightly modified version of possible worlds semantics that he labeled as “factual-normative worlds”. Factual-normative worlds are an ordered pair where “w” is a possible world (or a set of facts) and “n” is a complete system of general norms. The pair constitutes a creedal-normative state completely opinionated (Gibbard, 1990, p. 95).

According to Gibbard, any particular normative judgment holds or not, as a matter of logic, in the factual-normative world . That is, the pair is a set of sound and complete norms where, for each possible human behavior, we can state the normative status (Forbidden, Obligatory or Indifferent) associated with it. In this way each individual can understand the normative qualification of his or her action.

Consider a human observer who is uncertain both factually and normatively. When the observer will think about the rightness of a normative judgment, she or he will rule out any possible action which is not included into a set constituted by all the factual elements and all the normative elements in which that normative judgment is valid. Let’s take for instance, the modus ponens above:

1. If tormenting the cat is wrong, then getting your little brother to torment the cat is also wrong
2. Tormenting the cat is wrong
Therefore, getting your little brother to torment the cat is wrong.

The first premise rules out all the combinations in which it is not wrong to get your little brother to tell lies. The second premise rules out the set of combination between norms and facts in which is wrong to torment the cat. Therefore both premises together rules out the whole set of norms and facts in which it is not wrong to get your little brother to torment the cat; including any combination that the conclusion rules out.

What does it mean for a sentence to be valid in a particular factual-normative world? According to Gibbard it means that for each sentence containing a normative predicate there is a n-corresponding descriptive version which makes a normative predicate (such as “rational”) refer to a particular set of norms (that is “rational” according to the system n). Hence, Gibbard concludes, for any logically complex sentence S containing normative predicates in embedded contexts, we may construct the descriptive sentence Sn that arises from replacing all normative predicates in S by their n-corresponding version. Therefore we can operate with embedded contexts saying the sentence S holds in if and only if Sn holds in a possible world .

Actually Gibbard’s solution to the Geach-Frege problem is rather a bypass method to avoid the problem because he explains the functioning of normative language by means of descriptive language and semantical models. According to Sinnot-Armstrong’s criticism (1993), Gibbard’s analysis appears to be compatible with a realist view on norms because of his ambiguous use of normative judgment (which is a state of mind) and his use of possible world semantics.

5. The significance of the Geach-Frege Problem and Jorgensen’s Dilemma for non-cognitivism

The Geach-Frege problems and Jorgensen’s Dilemma are faces of the same coin. The first deals with the problem of mixed, or embedded, contexts (normative and descriptive) and how it is possible to deal with mixed sentences. The main problem here is the interpretation of connectives and logical operators in contexts that are partially lacking truth-values.

Jorgensen’s Dilemma, on the other hand, deals with making inferences between norms, that is, sentences that are lacking of truth-values, and to create a logical foundation that makes sense of inferences between norms we actually find sound in the everyday discourse. The Jorgensen’s Dilemma also tries to explain the very nature lying behind moral disagreements and the way we can rationally deliberate on them.

Both are questions involving the different illocutionary role of normative/expressive sentences and their solution represents a challenge to non-cognitivism. A positive solution to both challenges would open a room to the rationality of non-cognitive discourse in ethics. On the contrary, a negative one would show that the only option for rationalism in ethics is cognitivism or -- in the worst case scenario -- to irrationality and ethical nihilism.

Finally it is worth notice that while both cover a similar perspective, the Frege-Geach problem is more popular in moral philosophy, whereas Jorgensen’s Dilemma is more popular in the philosophy of law. It is difficult to understand the reasons for that different interest. We can only guess that it was because the analysis of sentences in terms of the Frege-Reichenbach model was popular among moral philosophers while it was virtually unknown (until the works by Alchourron and Bulygin, 1971) among philosophers of law.

6. A Taxonomy of Ethics

The following scheme is a development from R. M. Hare’s A Taxonomy of Ethical Theories (Hare, 1997, p. 42)

Descriptivism: Meanings of moral sentences are wholly determined by syntax and truth conditions.

Naturalism: Truth conditions of moral sentences are non-moral properties.

Objectivistic naturalism: These properties are objective.

Subjective naturalism: These properties are subjective.

Intuitionism: Truth conditions of moral sentences are sui generis moral properties.

Non-descriptivism: Meanings of moral sentences are not wholly determined by syntax and truth conditions.

Emotivism: Moral sentences are not governed by logic.

Rationalistic non-descriptivism: Moral sentences are governed by logic.

Universal prescriptivism: The logic, which governs moral sentences, is the logic of universal prescriptions.

Expressivism: The moral sentences are about beliefs and/or commitments; their logic is different from the logic of descriptive sentences.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Alchourrón, 1993: “Philosophical Foundations of Deontic Logic and the Logic of Defeasible Conditionals”, in Meyer e Wieringa (1993), Deontic Logic in Computer Science, Chichester, Wiley, pp.43-84.
  • Alchourrón, C. E. and Bulygin, E. (1981): “The Expressive Conception of Norms”, in Hilpinen, H. (ed.) (1981), New Essays in Deontic Logic, Dordrecht, D. Reidel, pp. 95-124
  • Alchourrón, C. E. and Bulygin, E. (1989): “Limits of Logic and Legal Reasoning”, in Martino, A.A. (ed.) (1989), Deontic Logic, Computational Linguistics and Legal Information Systems, Amsterdam, North-Holland, pp. 1-20.
  • Ayer, A. J. (1936): Language, Truth and Logic, London, Gollancz
  • Bentham, J. (1789): An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, eds. Burns, J.H. and Hart, H.L.A., London, Athlone Press, 1970
  • Bentham, J. (1970): Of Laws in General, ed. Hart, H.L.A., London, Athlone Press, 1970.
  • Blackburn, S. (1984): Spreading the Word, Oxford, Clarendon.
  • Bulygin, E. (1982): “Norms, normative propositions and legal statements”, in Floistad, G. (ed.), Contemporary Philosophy A New Survey, The Hague, M. Nijhoff, pp. 157-163; rist. in Alchourron e Bulygin (1991), pp. 215-238.
  • Geach, P. T., (1958): "Imperative and Deontic Logic", Analysis, 18, 3, pp. 49-56.
  • Geach, P. (1964): "Assertion", Philosophical Review, 74, pp. 449-465
  • Gibbard, A. (1990): Wise Choices, Apt Feelings. A Theory of Normative Judgement, Oxford, Clarendon Press
  • Hale, B., (1993): "Can There Be a Logic of Attitudes?", in Haldane, J., e Wright, C, (eds.) (1995), pp. 337-363
  • Hare, R. M. (1949): Imperatives Sentences, in Mind, LVIII;  in Hare (1971), pp.1-21.
  • Hare, R. M. (1952): The Language of Morals, Clarendon, Oxford.. Hare, R.M. (1963): Freedom and Reason, Oxford, Oxford U.P.
  • Hare, R. M. (1967): “Some Alleged Differences between Imperatives and Indicatives”, in Mind, LXXVI
  • Hare R. M. (1982): Moral Thinkings: Its Levels, Methods and Point, Oxford, Oxford U.P
  • Hare R. M. (1989): Essays in Ethical Theory, Oxford, Oxford U.P.
  • Hare R. M. (1997):Sorting Out Ethics, Oxford, O.U.P.
  • Jørgensen, J. (1937-38): “Imperatives and Logic”, in Erkenntnis, 7, pp. 288-296
  • Kelsen, H. (1941): “The Pure Theory of Law and Analytical Jurisprudence”, in Harvard Law Review, 60, pp. 44-70
  • Levinson, S. C. (1983): Pragmatics. Cambridge, Cambridge U.P.
  • Lyons, J. (1995): Linguistic Semantics. An Introduction, Cambridge, Cambridge U.P.
  • MacIntyre, A. (1957): "What Morality is Not", Philosophia, XXXII (123), pp. 325-335.
  • Marcus, B. (1966): "Iterated Deontic Modalities", Mind, 75, pp. 580-582.
  • Reichenbach, H (1947): Elements of Symbolic Logic, New York, McMillan
  • Russell, B. (1935): Religion and Science, Oxford U.P.
  • Searle, J.R. (1969): Speech Acts. An Essay in the Philosophy of Language, London, O.U.P.
  • Singer, M. (1985): "The Generalization Principle", in Potter, N.T. e Simmons M. (eds.) Morality and Universality, Boston, Dordrecht, pp. 47-73.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. (1993): "Some problems for Gibbard's norm-expressivism", Philosophical Studies, pp. 297-313.
  • Stevenson, C.L. (1944): Ethics and Language, New Haven, Yale U.P
  • Unwin, N. (1999): "Norms and Negation: A Problem for Gibbard's Logic", The Philosophical Quarterly, 51(202), pp.60-75
  • von Wright, G. H. (1963): Norm and Action. A Logical Inquiry, London, Routledge & Kegan Paul
  • Warnock, M. (1978): Ethics since 1900, Oxford, Oxford U.P.,
  • Williams, B. A. O. (1985): Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy, Cambridge (Mass.), Cambridge U.P.

Author Information

Antonio Marturano
University of Exeter
United Kingdom



Universals are a class of mind-independent entities, usually contrasted with individuals (or so-called "particulars"), postulated to ground and explain relations of qualitative identity and resemblance among individuals. Individuals are said to be similar in virtue of sharing universals. An apple and a ruby are both red, for example, and their common redness results from sharing a universal. If they are both red at the same time, the universal, red, must be in two places at once. This makes universals quite different from individuals; and it makes them controversial.

Whether universals are in fact required to explain relations of qualitative identity and resemblance among individuals has engaged metaphysicians for two thousand years. Disputants fall into one of three broad camps. Realists endorse universals. Conceptualists and Nominalists, on the other hand, refuse to accept universals and deny that they are needed. Conceptualists explain similarity among individuals by appealing to general concepts or ideas, things that exist only in minds. Nominalists, in contrast, are content to leave relations of qualitative resemblance brute and ungrounded. Numerous versions of Nominalism have been proposed, some with a great deal of sophistication. Contemporary philosophy has seen the rise of a new form of Nominalism, one that makes use of a special class of individuals, known as tropes. Familiar individuals have many properties, but tropes are single property instances. Whether Trope Nominalism improves on earlier Nominalist theories is the subject of much recent debate. In general, questions surrounding universals touch upon some of the oldest, deepest, and most abstract of philosophical issues.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. The Nature of Universals
    2. Reasons to Postulate Universals
    3. The Problem of Universals
  2. Versions of Realism
    1. Extreme Realism
    2. Strong Realism
    3. Objections to Realism
  3. Versions of Anti-Realism
    1. Predicate Nominalism
    2. Resemblance Nominalism
    3. Trope Nominalism
    4. Conceptualism
  4. Concluding Thoughts
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

An inventory of reality’s most fundamental entities would almost certainly include individuals. Individuals are singular objects. They can exist over time, but in only one place at a time. Individuals also have properties (also called qualities), at least most of which can vary over time. A ripening apple goes from being green to being red, for instance. Almost everyone agrees that individual apples exist, and that they are colored, but are redness and greenness entities themselves? If so, what are they like? And if redness and greenness are not real entities, how could our apple be colored at all? Without its distinctive qualities, an apple wouldn’t even be an apple.

Let us use the term “universal” for properties (or qualities).  In a philosophical tone of voice we can now ask, “Are there really such universals? If so, what is their nature? How are they related to individuals?” These questions start us down a road philosophers have been exploring since philosophy itself was young.

We can approach the question about the existence of universals from a linguistic perspective. Consider how often we speak of things having properties: “That apple is red;” “The oven is hot;” or “My shirt is dirty.” Such sentences have a subject-predicate structure. The subject term refers to the individual described in the sentence. The predicate, on the other hand, describes; it tells us something about the way that individual is, how it is qualified. Do predicates also refer? Some philosophers think they do. Alongside the individuals picked out by subject terms of sentences, it is thought, there are entities of a different kind, picked out by predicates. Once again we can call these “universals”.

Prima facie, there seems to be every reason to believe in universals. They look to be just as much a part of our experience as individuals are. Philosophical questions and problems arise, however, when we try to specify their natures. If universals are real, but are not individuals, what are they? Some philosophers contend that universals are too strange to accept into our world view. In a similar vein, it has been alleged that any philosophical work done by universals can be done just as well without them; whether they are strange or not, many argue, universals are simply unnecessary. Of course, it would need to be shown that universals really can be dispensed with, and we’ll return to this controversy. But first we will examine competing Realist conceptions of the nature of universals.

a. The Nature of Universals

In fundamental debates in metaphysics, it can be useful to understand the type of entity or concept in contrastive terms. For instance, it is helpful to understand universals by contrasting them with individuals. What then, is an individual, or a particular, in the philosophical or metaphysical sense of the term?

Traditionally, the term “individual” is used to pick out members of a certain category of existents, each member of which is said to be unique. More precisely, individuals are said to be non-repeatable (not multi-exemplifiable), which means that they can’t be in more than one place at a time. Examples include the familiar objects of sense-experience, such as chairs or tigers. A room may contain many chairs that are virtually alike in their intrinsic qualities, but each chair is nonetheless a distinct thing in one place at one time. By contrast, the universal “chair” is repeated around the room.

The individuals familiar from experience are also said to be material: they fill regions of space with impenetrable “stuff,” and are locatable in space and time. Some philosophers are committed to other types of individuals, as well: immaterial ones (such as souls and sense-data) and even ones that are also outside space and time (such as numbers and God). The crucial contrast for our purposes, however, is between what are repeatable (universals) and what are not (individuals).

Although individuals are nonrepeatable, universals can serve their characteristic functions only if they differ from individuals in this respect. In order to ground relations of qualitative identity, for instance, universals must be multi-exemplifiable (or repeatable), able to be here and there at the same time. My apple and yours are both individuals, and this implies that each can be in only one place at a time. But if the redness they share is a universal, then the redness they share is a real non-individual, literally in both. The apples are similar in virtue of sharing this universal, redness. And if redness is shared in this way, then it is in at least two places at once.

As we proceed we will get more precise about these characterizations, and explore variations that have been defended in opposing Realist accounts. But we can appreciate already why some philosophers balk at the existence of universals. For, as just noted, all defenders want to say that universals are repeatable. It seems, however, that defenders of universals must also say that universals are wholly present in each of the places they exist.

To explain, suppose we were to destroy one of the apples considered above. We’d have one fewer individual, to be sure. Would there be a diminishment of redness itself? It doesn’t seem so, since redness is held to be an entity in its own right. Nor does it seem to make sense to say that redness increases when another apple ripens and turns red. These considerations suggest that a universal is wholly present in each of its instances, and that the existence of a universal at one place is unrelated to its simultaneous existence at any other place. It’s not clear, however, how universals could be both wholly present in each of the places they exist, and, at the same time, present in many different places at once. This certainly would make them unusual, to say the least.

Moreover, it seems to be a mark of materiality that a material thing can be in only one place at a time. If so, then universals cannot be material. This in turn creates a problem when it comes to causation. For as we usually understand causal relations, one thing affects another by interacting with it, say by colliding with it. But that seems possible only if the entities in question are material. For these reasons it is difficult to explain how universals interact with other things that exist. The puzzle becomes more acute when we wonder how we can know universals at all. Don’t they have to interact with our brains for us to know them? If they are not material, this interaction is quite mysterious.

In summation, we’ve seen that universals are quite different from individuals, and in ways that make them odd. Philosophers with low tolerance for strangeness tend to dismiss them for these reasons. Why, then, do some philosophers continue to believe in them, despite their unusual natures?

b. Reasons to Postulate Universals

Universals are called on to serve many philosophical functions. For most of this article, we’ll focus on one particularly famous one – the role universals play in professed solutions to what has come to be called “The Problem of Universals.”

First, a word or two about postulating entities is in order. Here we might compare the philosophical enterprise of deciding whether universals exist with the scientific enterprise of deciding whether strange unobservable entities, like quarks or neutrinos, exist. The scientific case is itself controversial, but many scientists and philosophers believe in the existence of unobservables, provided the theories that postulate them best explain the observable phenomena under study. For example, many believe the universe contains what physicists call “black holes,” in part because the best (perhaps only) way to explain a range of stellar phenomena is to suppose that black holes are responsible. Again, this is controversial, but if the explanation provided is the best (or only) explanation, many scientists and philosophers claim a right to believe the postulated unobservables exist.

In parallel, we now ask, “Are there any philosophical puzzles or problems that can best be solved by believing in universals?” In fact, universals have been called on to answer a range of philosophical questions. Recall our points about subjects, predicates and reference. Prima facie, a name wouldn’t be a name if there weren’t something for it to refer to. Some philosophers think that the meaning of a name just is its referent. What about general terms, terms that can be said of many things, such as “red“ or “wise”? What gives those terms meaning? Some have said that predicates must have referents to be meaningful, and universals fit the bill.

Universals have also been called on to solve problems in the theory of knowledge. Plato, for instance, said that for us to know something, that which is known must be unchanging. Since material individuals are subject to change, Plato argued, there must be things that don’t change, suitable as objects of genuine knowledge, not just belief. Universals might fit the bill here, too.

Relatedly, some philosophers have argued that we need universals to understand the stable, unchanging laws of nature that govern individuals’ changes. Indeed, it has been argued that a law of nature just is a relation among universals, by which one universal brings about, or necessitates, others.

Our focus in this essay concerns another role for universals, perhaps the most famous one. They are said to answer what seems a very simple question, but which turns out to be one of the most famous and long-standing issues in philosophy. This returns us to the so-called “Problem of Universals.”

c. The Problem of Universals

Often we predicate properties of individuals. When we say that both cherries and rubies are red, for instance, we seem to say individuals share common properties, those that make cherries cherries, those that make rubies rubies, and those that make both red. Predicates are said of many subjects, then, but is there anything in reality to match the linguistic one-over-many? Are there general truths? Is there commonality in nature, in reality; or is commonality imagined and illusory, perhaps a mere product of language? If the latter, how can we accommodate the intuition that it is the world, and not our conventions, that make predications true or false? The Problem of Universals arises when we ask these questions. Attempts to solve this problem divide into three broad strategies: Realism, Nominalism, and Conceptualism. We’ll take these in turn, and consider the pros and cons of each.

2. Versions of Realism

We’ll begin by examining versions of Realism, all of which claim that yes, there are universals; yes, there are truths about the general; yes, there is commonality in nature. Unless we accept universals into our world view, the Realist argues, we will be unable to explain a fundamental and apparent fact, namely, that there is genuine commonality and systematicity in nature. Again, experience suggests that the individuals we encounter share properties with other individuals. Some are red, and some are not; some are blue, and some are not; some are emeralds, and some are not. Realists claim what makes it the case that these individuals seem to share properties is that in fact they do. There is an entity, a universal, present in each of these individuals at once, which in turn explains our right to say that they are qualitatively identical.

a. Extreme Realism

The oldest, and most famous, variant of Realism comes from Plato. Plato’s position is that in order to explain the qualitative identity of distinct individuals, we must accept that there is another entity besides the resembling individuals, an entity we’ve called a universal, and which Plato would call a Form. If two apples, for example, are both red, this is because there is a Form of Red that is able to manifest itself in both those apples at once.

Really there are three different components in this picture. There is the individual, a particular apple; there is the red of that apple - which exists right “in” or with that apple; and finally, there is the Form of Red, which manifests itself in the red of this apple (and of course, the red of other apples). What, then, is the nature of the Form itself, which provides for the bit of red we see in this apple or in that?

On Plato’s view, Forms are immaterial. They are also outside of space and time altogether. They are wholly abstract, we might say. Of course, for the Form of Red to make an individual apple red, the Form must somehow be related to the apple. Plato postulates a relation of participation to meet this need, and speaks of things “participating” in Forms, and getting their qualities by virtue of this relation of participation. One last point about the nature of Forms proves crucial. For the Form of Red to explain or ground the redness of an apple, the Form of Red must itself be red, or so it seems. How could a Form make an apple red, if the Form were not itself red?

As we noted, Plato’s account of generality was the first one, and it has held great appeal ever since. But it is also subject to serious criticisms. Interestingly, one of the most devastating objections to the theory of Forms comes from Plato himself. We will return later to this famous objection, which has come to be known as the Third Man Argument. Because of the power of this argument, many philosophers sympathetic to Realism have looked elsewhere for a solution to the Problem of Universals. We’ll explore one alternative now.

b. Strong Realism

Although the first position is credited to Plato, this next one is widely thought to be inspired by Aristotle. The key in this position is its rejection of independently existing Forms. As we noted in Section 2a., Extreme Realists posit an explanatory triad involving an individual, the quality of this individual, and the Form that grounds the quality of this individual (and that one, and others). Strong Realists, in contrast, resist this triad. When an individual has a quality, there is simply the individual and its quality. No third, independent thing is needed to ground possession of the quality. A universal, on this view, just is the quality that is in this individual and any other qualitatively identical individuals. The universal red, for example, is in this apple, that apple, and all apples that are similarly red. It is not distinct and independent from the individuals that have this color. Because it is a universal it can exist in many places at once. According to Strong Realism, the universal red in my apple is numerically identical to the red in yours; one universal is in two individuals at once. It is wholly present in each place where it exists.

As we’ll see, Strong Realism is immune to the Third Man Argument. It also reduces the strangeness of Realism. We need not have Forms that are abstract, in the sense of being outside of space and time, mysteriously grounding the qualities of material individuals. The Strong Realist’s universals are in space and time, and are able to be in many places at once. Multiple exemplification may be considered strange, but it not as strange as existence outside space and time.

c. Objections to Realism

We turn now to objections. We’ve already seen what might be called the Strangeness Objection. This is the intuition some philosophers have that universals are just too odd-natured to be accepted into our world view. These philosophers typically countenance only what is material, spatiotemporal, and nonrepeatable; and universals just don’t fit the bill. Philosophers who believe in only individuals are known as Nominalists. We’ll return to them later. We should note, however, that there are other versions of Realism in addition to the two we’ve discussed. Medieval philosophers spent much time exploring these issues, and formulated many versions of Realism. This introduction to the Problem of Universals will not explore these other variants, though they too are vulnerable to the objection that closes this section.

Extreme Realism is challenged by the Third Man Argument. Recall the essentials of that position, in particular, what is said about the nature of the Forms. For any given quality had by an individual there is a Form of that quality, one that exists separately from individuals, and also from the quality found in each particular individual. There is the apple, the red of this apple (and the red of that apple), and the Form of Red. By participating in the Form of Red, the apple gets its particular bit of redness. And finally, as we saw, the Form Red must itself be red. Otherwise it couldn’t provide for the redness of the apple. Suppose we now ask, “What explains the red of the Form of Red, which itself, as we said, is red?” Coming to believe in the existence of Forms begins with the urge to explain the redness of apples and other material individuals, but once this step is taken, the Extreme Realist is forced to explain the redness of the Form of Red itself.

To explain the redness of the Form of Red, in Extreme Realist fashion, we will have to say that the Form of Red participates in a Form. After all, a fundamental tenet of Extreme Realism is that possession of a quality always results from participation in a Form. Presumably, a Form cannot participate in itself. Therefore, if the redness of the Form of Red is to be explained, we’ll need to say that the Form of Red participates in a higher-order Form, Red2 . Moreover, participation in Red2 will explain the redness of Red1 only if the higher-order Form, Red2, is itself red. Of course, now we will have to explain the redness of the Form of Red2, and that will require us to introduce yet another Form, in this case, the Form of Red3, which the Form of Red2 participates in to get its redness.

It is clear that this will go on indefinitely. So it seems that we will never have an explanation of why or how the Form of Red is actually red. That means we’ll never be able to explain why our original apple is red. That was what we wanted initially, and so it seems that Plato’s theory is unable to provide an answer. This has led many to reject Plato’s theory. (There is, not surprisingly, a large body of secondary literature which explores whether Plato’s theory can survive this objection and what Plato himself thought about it, since, as we’ve mentioned, it was Plato himself who first raised the objection.)

The Third Man Argument threatens only Extreme Realism. Strong Realists do not rely on independently existing Forms to explain the redness of individuals, and so they need not explain why an independent existent - the Form of Red - is itself red. Instead, Strong Realists can simply note that the universal present in each apple is itself red, and the red of this universal explains the red of each apple, and also their similarity with respect to color.

However, the objection to which we now turn threatens all variants of Realism. This final objection is not so much an argument that Realism is intrinsically flawed, but rather that Realism is unnecessary. A general principle governing many metaphysical debates is that, other things being equal, the fewer types or kinds of entities in one’s ontology, the better. Those opposed to Realism argue that they can meet the explanatory demands we’ve discussed without relying on universals. If qualitative resemblance and identity can be accounted for without universals, and if any other work done with universals can be done as well without them, then, the opponents of Realism argue, we should do without them. We will then have fewer categories in our ontology, which, other things being equal, is to be preferred.

For this reason, opponents of Realism try to solve the Problem of Universals without universals. The question we will track is whether such solutions are in fact adequate. If not, perhaps commitment to universals, however unpalatable, is necessary.

3. Versions of Anti-Realism

We’ll call any proposed solution to the Problem of Universals that doesn’t endorse universals a version of “Anti-Realism”. Anti-Realists divide into two camps: Nominalists and Conceptualists. Nominalists maintain that only individuals exist. They argue that the Problem of Universals can be solved through proper thinking about individuals, and by appeal to nothing more than the natures of, and relations among, individuals. Conceptualists, in contrast, deny that individuals suffice to solve the Problem, but they also resist appealing to mind-independent universals. Instead, qualitative identity and resemblance are explained by reference to concepts or ideas. We will explore this Conceptualist strategy at the conclusion of our discussion of Anti-Realism. First we will survey a range of Nominalist theories.

a. Predicate Nominalism

How can we explain the qualitative identity of distinct individuals without relying on universals? One strategy begins by giving an account of what makes a single individual, which we will call “Tom,” red. A minimal, but perhaps sufficient answer is to say that Tom is red because the predicate “is red” can be truly said of Tom. As for the predicate “is red” itself, it is just a particular string of words on a page (or this screen), or else a string of spoken sounds. Expanding this strategy we get the view that two individuals, say Tom and Bob, are red simply because the linguistic expression, the predicate “is red,” is truly said of both. We account for commonality in nature by reference to individuals—in this case the individuals Bob and Tom, and also linguistic expressions such as the predicate “is red.”

On this view then, all that exist are individuals and words for talking about those individuals. This seems metaphysically innocuous, but many philosophers charge that Predicate Nominalism ignores the Problem of Universals, and does not solve it. Why is it true to say that both Bob and Tom are red, for instance, and not green or blue? What is it about the world, the individuals, that explains why they are that way and not some other way? What explains their similarity? Predicate Nominalists just leave it as a brute fact that some things are red (or blue, or green). More precisely, what they leave brute is the fact that, for any given individual, some predicates correctly apply and others don’t. But when it comes to explaining these facts, Predicate Nominalism will go no further. This refusal to take the Problem of Universals seriously has even landed Predicate Nominalism the label “Ostrich Nominalism.”

b. Resemblance Nominalism

Another Nominalist strategy is to collect individuals into sets based on resemblance relations, and then account for qualitative identity and resemblance by appeal to commonalities of set membership. An individual’s redness, for example, is explained by the fact that it belongs to the set of red things. The fact that two individuals are both red is explained by their both belonging to the same set of red things. A given set, such as the set of red things, is constructed by adding to it individuals that resemble each other more closely than they resemble any nonmembers, that is, the individuals that aren’t red. In this way, Resemblance Nominalists explain individuals’ supposed shared qualities by talking only about resemblance relations. Things that resemble each other belong to a common set. Membership in a certain set defines what it is to have a certain property, and two members of a set can be said to share a property, or be qualitatively identical, in virtue of simply belonging to the same set of resembling individuals.

In the course of trying to account for two distinct properties, however, Resemblance Nominalists can end up constructing the same set twice. If two distinct properties were to pick out the same set, however, this would cause a serious problem. For instance, it is thought that everything that has a heart also has a kidney. If so, the set of individuals constructed for the property “has a heart” will have the same members as the set constructed for the property “has a kidney.” Two sets with the same members are really just one set, not two, by the very definition of “set,” so Resemblance Nominalists are forced to say that having a heart is one and the same property as having a kidney. But that is clearly false.

A second problem for the Resemblance Nominalist arises when we wonder about the method of set construction. Accounting for an individual’s redness requires building a set with that individual and other resembling individuals as members. But, unfortunately for Resemblance Nominalism, some members of the red-set actually turn out to not be red at all. To explain, remember that the construction of the set proceeds by grouping particulars that resemble each other, and, importantly, things can resemble each other in various respects. Our red apple resembles other red apples, red stop signs, and red books, and all those things would thus get into the set. But our red apple also resembles a green apple, of the same type, which isn’t ripe yet. So that green apple would go in the set. Other things, too, will resemble our apple, but not by being red. As such, it seems that Resemblance Nominalism “explains” our individual’s being red by reference to a set containing non-red things, which is just to say it doesn’t explain it at all.

The tempting reply here is, “Sure, the green apple does resemble our red apple, but not in the right way. If you stop building sets with the wrong kinds of resemblance, you won’t let non-red members into the set.” The problem with this reply is that the only way to stop these “bad” resemblances is to include in the set only things that are red. But remember, being red is what the Nominalist is trying to explain in the first place, and so we can’t use being red to guide set construction. To do so would be circular.

A third objection arises when we consider the resemblance relation itself. Resemblance Nominalism cannot succeed without this relation; it bears most of the explanatory load. Arguably, then, the position is committed to the existence of resemblance relations. This seems to generate a serious problem. Individuals resemble one another, of course, but resemblance itself is not an individual. So, if the position is committed to resemblance relations, and if resemblance relations are not individuals, then it seems that Resemblance Nominalism is a misnomer. Upon close inspection, the position looks to be a kind of Realism. Suppose three things (a, b, and c) resemble one another, and belong in the same set. We have three individuals in this case, but what about the instances of resemblance that hold among those individuals? Are they the same kind of resemblance? They had better be, if the previous objection is to be avoided! Resemblance Nominalists, then, need to posit instances of, and kinds of, resemblance, all of which suggests we actually have a universal here—namely, the resemblance relation that holds between a and b, between b and c, and between a and c. If resemblance itself is a universal, Resemblance Nominalists are committed to at least one universal. Perhaps they should make life easier (if not simpler) and let them all in!

The above objections have moved some Nominalists to develop alternative accounts. Many have turned to Trope Nominalism, which we will discuss next. Trope Nominalism is committed to a new kind of entity, tropes. This may seem surprising, since Nominalists insist on ontological simplicity. But while Nominalists allow only individuals into their ontology, this doesn’t preclude explanatory appeals to tropes. For tropes, as we will see, are a class of individuals. Perhaps with this innovation Nominalists will fare better.

c. Trope Nominalism

Though they were known to Medieval philosophers, tropes are relatively new to contemporary metaphysics, and have been called on to address a number of very different philosophical issues, including the Problem of Universals. Trope theory can be understood, somewhat paradoxically, as making properties into particulars. Tropes are a type of individual. While ordinary individuals are qualitatively complex, a trope is qualitatively simple, and is, in fact, a particular property instance. The blue of the sky is a particular trope numerically distinct from the blue-trope of your T-shirt, even if the two tropes are qualitatively identical.

For the tropist, ordinary individual objects can be conceived as bundles or collections of tropes; and an ordinary object, which is a complex particular, has a certain quality in virtue of having, as a member of the complex, a particular trope, which is that particular character. An apple thus is a complex of tropes—a red trope plus an apple-shape trope, plus a sweet trope, plus a crisp trope, and so forth. If the apple is red, that is because there is a red trope, a red individual, that is a member of that bundle or complex. Red is not a property the trope has; rather, the red trope is the red itself. (Instead of treating an ordinary object as nothing more than a bundle of tropes, another option is to treat an individual as a substance that possesses a bundle of tropes. For simplicity, we will set that option aside. Whether an object is, or instead has, a bundle of tropes, the coming points hold.)

Trope Nominalism explains qualitative identity between two distinct ordinary individuals by saying that the first individual has a constituent trope that is qualitatively identical to, but numerically distinct from, a trope had as constituent by the second individual. Two apples are red, for instance, because each has a red trope “in” them, and these tropes themselves are individuals that exactly resemble each other. Importantly, because this is a version of Nominalism, we don’t say the tropes resemble each other because they share a universal. Instead, they simply resemble each other. If we like, we can expand on the claim that red tropes resemble each other by constructing sets of resembling individuals. In this case, we would have a set of red tropes, the members of which resemble each other more closely than they resemble any other tropes. In summary, then, by appeal to qualitatively identical, but numerically distinct tropes, we can explain qualitative similarities among ordinary objects, all without reliance on universals.

How is this better than Resemblance Nominalism? Remember that Resemblance Nominalism was vulnerable because it explained qualitative identity of individuals by reference to sets of resembling individuals. The trouble was that the individuals collected into sets are ordinary objects, ones that have many properties, so they can resemble each other in many ways. For this reason, no noncircular criterion of set construction could exclude members with the wrong property. Tropes, however, have only one property, so if individual tropes are collected into sets, there won’t be members that don’t belong. The set of red tropes will have only red tropes in it. Trope Nominalists can now make unproblematic appeal to “resemblance among individuals.” This has convinced many that Trope Nominalism is a serious contender against Realism.

As well, recall that Resemblance Nominalism faced the charge that only a resemblance universal could account for resemblance relations among individuals. Trope Nominalism has a reply here too. (As always, in any complex philosophical discussion, there are various ways to reply to objections, just as there are many objections. We outline here just one of the ways Trope theories have responded to this objection.) Whereas Resemblance Nominalists seemed forced to countenance a resemblance universal, Trope Nominalists can appeal to resemblance tropes! Should we have, for example, three identical red tropes, then there will be a resemblance relation between a and b, a similar relation between b and c, and a similar relation between a and c. Trope Nominalism can treat each of these resemblances as distinct tropes. When three red tropes are mutually resembling, then, in addition to the red tropes themselves, there are three resemblance tropes. And just as the resemblance among the three red individuals is a basic fact, so too is the resemblance among these resemblance relations. Not all resemblances are alike, of course, but in this case they are. All properties are tropes, and properties include not just ones like “red,” but also ones like “resembles.”

But there are still problems, perhaps, for Trope Nominalism. Recall that we began by wondering how distinct ordinary things could be said to be qualitatively identical without introducing a universal common to both. Tropists instruct us to view ordinary particulars as complexes of tropes, and allow that there can be qualitatively similar but numerically distinct tropes present in different complexes. Qualitative similarity among ordinary objects is explained by the qualitative similarities of their constituent tropes. Finally, the qualitative similarity among distinct tropes is explained by the fact that some (for example, red) tropes resemble each other more closely than other (for example, non-red) tropes. The last point is the crucial one. We are told that it is simply a brute fact that some tropes resemble each other, and that others don’t. That is just the way things are, and there is no further explanation to be given. But tropes were meant to do explanatory work; so, at the level of tropes, we want and expect an account of generality. If trope theories are presented as a solution to the Problem of Universals, they should explain how there can be truths to explain the appearance of generality in reality. What we end up with, though, is brute and ungrounded qualitative identity among distinct tropes. In essence then, the tropist dismisses, but does not solve, a question about the nature of generality, by making generality a brute fact. Unlike Predicate Nominalism, the tropist goes to great lengths to develop a theory, but in the end seems to offer no more explanation of generality. We know that our original objects resemble each other. Why? Because they have tropes that resemble each other. But the latter resemblance is not explained. And so it seems we’ve not gone very far in explaining our original resemblance. What we want is an explanation of qualitative similarity. Accounting for it in terms of qualitative similarity—now at the level of tropes—does no more than relocate the question. The very relation we sought to understand reappears as our answer.

Again, qualitative similarity across ordinary particulars is explained by the relation of qualitative similarity holding among the tropes that constitute those particulars. But that seems either to postpone answering the question, or to answer it by appealing to the very fact we wanted explained. At best, this explanation is unsatisfying; at worst, it is circular. We are left with qualitative identity as a brute, unexplained phenomenon, triggering the reasonable question: What then have we really gained with trope theories?

d. Conceptualism

A final strategy for avoiding universals comes by making generality not a feature of reality, but instead a feature of our minds and the concepts or ideas in minds. Conceptualism thus seeks a third way, as they see it, between the excesses of Realism, and the unilluminating resemblance relations of Nominalism. Because many individuals can fall under the same concept, Conceptualism hopes to accommodate the intuition that qualitative identity and resemblance are grounded in the sharing of something, but in a way that doesn't appeal to dubious items such as universals. According to this view, individuals a and b are red because the concept of redness applies to both. The concept red is general, not because it denotes a real non-individual, but only because many diverse particulars fall under, or conform to, that concept.

As tidy as this seems, it too suffers from problems. To see this, we need to realize that concepts can be misapplied in some cases, such as when we say of a cat that it is a dog. And misapplied concepts explain nothing deep about generality. Conceptualism's appeal to concept application must concern only correct concept application. As such, it is fair to ask, “What makes it the case that the concept red is rightly applied to both a and b, but not of some third individual, c?” To treat this fact as brute and inexplicable is to revert to problematic Predicate Nominalism. So it seems the Conceptualist must say that the concept red applies to a and b, but not c, because a and b share a common feature, a feature c lacks. Otherwise, the application of red is unconstrained by the individuals to which it applies. But simply noting that a and b resemble each other isn't going to help, because that just is the fact we originally sought to explain, put differently. The Conceptualist might now say that a and b share a property. But if this isn't to amount to a restatement of the original datum, it must now be interpreted as the claim that some entity is in both a and b. That, of course, turns our supposed Conceptualist strategy back into Realism.

Critics say Conceptualism solves no problems on its own. In trying to ground our right to predicate the concept red of a and b, we are driven back to facts about a and b themselves and that leaves Conceptualism as an unstable position. It teeters back and forth between Realism, on the one hand, and Nominalism, on the other.

4. Concluding Thoughts

As with many issues in philosophy, we started with a fairly simple question and found it difficult to reach a satisfactory answer. Qualitative similarity is a seemingly undeniable feature of our experience of the world. And there seems to be every reason to expect an explanation for this common fact. But upon closer inspection we find that we must either accept some rather unusual items into our world view, or go through some fairly elaborate theorizing to reach an answer. And that elaborate theorizing itself seems full of problems.

Perhaps this explains why the Problem of Universals has had such a hold on philosophers for all these years. We sense that there must be an adequate solution to be found, but our failure to find one prods our reason and imagination. Of course, we’ve only skimmed the surface of this debate in this essay, and nearly every move we’ve discussed has been debated, reformulated, argued for and against, analyzed, accepted as obviously true and rejected as obviously false. A consensus does seem to be emerging though, as one of the main contributors to the debate in recent decades has articulated, that two genuine contenders are left: Strong Realism and Trope Nominalism. As always, there is much work to be done on this issue, despite its distinguished heritage. We hope this introduction to the problem has inspired you to seek a new path, to find a flaw in our reasoning, to note what hasn’t been noted before. You might turn out to be the next Plato.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D.M. Universals: An Opinionated Introduction (Boulder: Westview Press, 1989).
    • An excellent survey of nearly every position in the debate over universals, by one of the most important contributors to this century’s version of the debate.
  • Armstrong, D.M. What is a Law of Nature? (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1983).
    • An overview of the debate over the laws of nature, with a defense of univerals as the required elements in an adequate account.
  • Campbell, K. Abstract Particulars (Oxford: Basil Blackwell Ltd., 1990).
    • An important introduction to the theory of tropes, showing the versatility and potential of this metaphysical category.
  • Loux, M. Metaphysics: A Contemporary Introduction (London: Routledge, 1998).
    • Covers foundational debates on a number of areas, with particular attention to the Problem of Universals.
  • Simons, P. "Particulars in Particular Clothing: Three Trope Theories of Substance," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 54 (1994), pp. 553-75.
    • A sophisticated exploration of various trope theories with important proposals for advancing this theory. Reveals the potential power of this position as an alternative to Realism.
  • Spade, P.V. (trans.) Five Texts on the Mediaeval Problem of Universals (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1994).
    • Indispensable collection of important Medieval texts with useful guides and comments.
  • Vlastos, G., “The Third Man Argument in the Parmenides,” Philosophical Review 63 (1954), pp. 319-49.
    • A landmark article on Plato’s Third Man Argument, one that rekindled widespread interest in Plato’s metaphysics.

Author Information

Mary C. MacLeod
Indiana University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.


Eric M. Rubenstein
Indiana University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.



Introspection is the process by which someone comes to form beliefs about her own mental states. We might form the belief that someone else is happy on the basis of perception – for example, by perceiving her behavior. But a person typically does not have to observe her own behavior in order to determine whether she is happy. Rather, one makes this determination by introspecting.

When compared to other beliefs that we have, the beliefs that we acquire through introspection seem epistemically special. What exactly this amounts to is discussed in the first part of this essay. The second part addresses the nature of introspection. Though the term “introspection” literally means “looking within” (from the Latin “spicere” meaning “to look” and “intra” meaning “within”), whether introspecting should be treated analogously to looking – that is, whether introspection is a form of inner perception – is debatable. Philosophers have offered both observational and non-observational accounts of introspection. Following the discussion of these various issues about the epistemology and nature of introspection, the third section of this essay addresses an important use to which introspection has been put in philosophical discussions, namely, to draw metaphysical conclusions about the nature of mind.

Table of Contents

  1. 1. The Epistemic “Specialness” of Introspection
    1. a. Infallibility
    2. b. Self-intimation
    3. c. Self-warrant
    4. d. Immediacy
  2. 2. The Nature of Introspection
    1. a. Observational Models
    2. b. Non-Observational Models
    3. c. Skepticism about Introspection
  3. 3. Introspection and the Nature of Mind
    1. a. Introspectibility as a Mark of the Mental
    2. b. Introspective Arguments for Dualism
  4. 4. References and Further Reading

1. The Epistemic “Specialness” of Introspection

We form beliefs about our own mental states by introspection. How exactly introspection works will be discussed in the next section. But however it works, philosophers have long taken note of the fact that each individual’s introspective capacity seems to place her in a unique position to form beliefs, and gain knowledge, of her own mental states. An individual’s introspective beliefs about her own mental states seem in some way more secure than her beliefs about the external world, including her beliefs about the mental states of other people. Correspondingly, her introspective beliefs about her own mental states seem more secure than the beliefs that anyone else could form about her mental states. In these ways, there seems to be something epistemically special about the beliefs that we form on the basis of introspection. Typically, this specialness has been referred to as the privileged access that we have to our own mental states.

To say that an individual has privileged access to her own mental states is to say that she is in a better position than anyone else to acquire knowledge (or perhaps, justified beliefs) about them. But what exactly does privileged access amount to? In this section, of the numerous different claims that philosophers have made in this regard are discussed. (See Alston 1971 for a particularly comprehensive discussion of these and similar claims.)

a. Infallibility

In the Meditations on First Philosophy, Descartes worries that he may be deceived by an evil demon. As a result, all of his beliefs about the external world may well be false. But however powerful the demon may be, Descartes claims that it cannot deceive him about the contents of his own mind. Though it might not be true that he is seeing, hearing and feeling what he thinks he is, it is nonetheless true, he says, that “I certainly seem to see, to hear, and to be warmed. This cannot be false.” (Descartes 1641/1986)

This passage has been commonly interpreted in terms of infallibility. As such, it gives us one of the strongest claims that philosophers have made about the epistemic specialness of our self-knowledge: One cannot have a false belief about one’s own mental states. In this way, I am in a privileged position to make judgments about my mental states, since other people can have false beliefs about my mental states. But, necessarily, if I believe that I am in a particular mental state, then I am in that mental state.

Before discussing this thesis, it is worth noting that there has been some unfortunate terminological messiness in this area. Sometimes the terms “incorrigibility” or “indubitability” have been used as a synonym for what has just been referred to as “infallibility.” For example, when Armstrong (1963) asks whether introspective knowledge is incorrigible, he has in mind the claim that it is logically impossible for someone to be mistaken when she makes a sincere introspective report. He then explicitly uses the words “incorrigible” and “indubitable” interchangeably. (See also Shoemaker 1963, who uses the term “incorrigible” to refer to any sincere introspective report in which “it does not make sense to suppose, and nothing could be accepted as showing, that [the individual] is mistaken, i.e., that what he says is false.”) However, the terms “incorrigibility” and “indubitability” are also often distinguished from one another, and from “infallibility,” to pick out related, but different, kinds of epistemic specialness. On this usage, an individual’s introspective belief is said to be incorrigible when no one else can have grounds for correcting it; an individual’s introspective belief is said to be indubitable when she herself can have no grounds for rejecting it. (See Alston 1971 and Gallois 1996.) Note that these three kinds of epistemic specialness can clearly come apart. For example, we can conceive (at least in principle) of cases in which an individual’s introspective report was false even though no one else had grounds for correcting it, or in which the individual herself has no grounds to reject it. It thus seems best to keep separate the terms “infallibility,” “incorrigibility,” and “indubitability.” This essay reserves the term “infallibility” for the claim discussed above that it is not possible for me to believe that I am in a given mental state unless I am in that mental state.

One further qualification is also needed. As stated above, the infallibility thesis concerns our self-knowledge generally, rather than just our introspective knowledge, and is thus overly broad. Suppose that in the course of a polite disagreement, a friend accuses me of being angry at her. In fact, she is lying to cover her own anger at me. But, because she is normally reliable, I might take her accusation at face value and become convinced that I am angry at her. This case, in which I have the belief that I am angry even though I am not, shows that we can have fallible self-knowledge. (See Gertler 2003b for some similar examples.) The case does not show, however, that we can have fallible introspective knowledge. In fact, one might suppose that my belief in the case above is mistaken precisely because it was not formed on the basis of introspection, but rather on the basis of my friend’s testimony. Proponents of infallibility undoubtedly intend the infallibility thesis to apply only to introspective knowledge and not to self-knowledge more generally. To make this clear, we can insert the following qualification in the statement of the infallibility claim: Necessarily, if I believe on the basis of introspection that I am in a particular mental state, then I am in that mental state.

Thus understood, the infallibility thesis enjoys some intuitive support, particularly when it comes to certain types of mental states like sensations. How can I be wrong that I am in pain right now? (See Shoemaker 1990 for an attempt to flesh out the inherent plausibility of the infallibility thesis.) Nonetheless, it is now almost uniformly rejected by both philosophers and psychologists alike. Some obvious counterexamples come from our assessments of our emotional states and character traits. Individuals are notoriously poor judges of whether they are feeling jealous, for example. And of course there are widespread examples from literature and cinema where it is plain to everyone but the bickering hero and heroine themselves that, despite their protestations to the contrary, they are really in love.

Arguing against the infallibility thesis, Churchland (1988) suggests that we make mistakes in our introspective judgments because of expectation, presentation, and memory effects, – three phenomena that are familiar from the case of perception. As an example where expectations come into play, he offers the case of a captured spy whose interrogators have repeatedly tortured him by briefly pressing a hot iron against his back. What would happen if, after 19 times with the hot iron, the torturers surreptitiously use an ice cube instead? Since the spy strongly expects to feel pain, Churchland suggests that the spy’s immediate reaction to the ice cube will not differ significantly from the reactions that he had to the hot iron, i.e., he will mistakenly think he is feeling pain. (See also Warner 1993.) Likewise, Churchland argues that when a sensation is presented to us for a very short duration of time, mistakes are not just likely but inevitable. Finally, he asks us to consider someone who suffered neural damage at a young age and has subsequently not felt pain or any other tactile sensation for 50 years. Then suppose that her neural deficits were somehow overcome. In such a situation, Churchland argues that it would be quite implausible to suppose that she would be able instantly and infallibly to discriminate and identify all of her newly regained sensations.

Churchland’s criticisms of the infallibility thesis in some ways echo worries raised by James almost a century earlier. As James noted, “Even the writers who insist upon the absolute veracity of our immediate inner apprehension of a conscious state have to contrast with this the fallibility of our memory or observation of it, a moment later.” He concludes that “introspection is difficult and fallible; and that the difficulty is simply that of all observation of whatever kind.” (James 1890/1950)

Another line of objection to the claim of infallibility derives from some remarks of Wittgenstein (1958). In the course of offering his private language argument, he worries about how an individual in isolation would be able to develop a language to refer to her own sensations. The problem is that in such cases there “is no criterion of correctness. One would like to say: whatever is going to seem right to me is right. And that only means that here we can’t talk about ‘right.’” Armstrong (1963) fleshes out the objection as follows (see also Wright 1989):

If introspective mistake is ruled out by logical necessity, then what sense can we attach to the notion of gaining knowledge by introspection? We can speak of gaining knowledge only in cases where it makes sense to speak of thinking wrongly that we have gained knowledge. In the words of the slogan: ‘If you can’t be wrong, then you can’t be right either.’ If failure is logically impossible, then talk of success is meaningless.

In the empirical domain, work in a variety of areas provides important evidence for the fallibility of introspection. Influential studies by Nisbett and Wilson (1977) suggest that we often misdescribe our own reasoning processes. In one study, subjects were presented with four pairs of stockings and asked to indicate which pair had the highest quality. The leftmost pair was preferred by a factor of almost four to one. However, unbeknownst to the subjects, all four pairs of stockings were identical. Though position effects were clearly playing a role in the subjects’ choice, none of them identified position when asked to explain their reasoning, and those who were asked explicitly whether position played any role in their reasoning process all denied it. The evidence from this and other studies thus suggests that people often form mistaken beliefs about what reasoning processes they are utilizing; as Nisbett and Wilson conclude, the evidence is “consistent with the most pessimistic view concerning people’s ability to report accurately about their cognitive processes.”

However interesting this result, Nisbett and Wilson’s work might not seem especially threatening to most proponents of infallibility, since it concerns introspective access only to higher order reasoning processes, and in particular, the ability to recognize outside influences on those processes. But who would have ever thought that we were infallible with respect to that? In contrast, empirical work on “changeblindness,” which calls into question our introspective access to our current perceptual states, seems to pose a deeper threat. According to work done by Kevin O’Regan (who works, ironically, at the Universite Rene Descartes in France), subjects typically fail to notice even large changes to objects in their visual field, as long as the change occurs simultaneously with some other “disruption,” such as a blink or a mudsplash on a windshield. (See, e.g., O’Regan et al, 1999.)

One might try to qualify the infallibility thesis to address some of the above objections. For example, one might restrict the infallibility thesis only to those judgments that are made after careful reflection. Alternatively, one might restrict the infallibility thesis to a subclass of mental states. For example, Jackson (1973) defends a limited infallibility thesis, claiming that we are infallible only about our current phenomenal states. However, Schwitzgebel (2005) adduces numerous considerations to suggest that we should reject even these attenuated infallibility theses. According to Schwitzgebel, we are prone to gross error even in introspective judgments that are often taken to be epistemically the most secure, namely, those about currently ongoing visual experience. Though we typically assume that visual experience consists of a broad stable field with imprecision or haziness only at the borders, introspective experiments that force us to direct our attention away from the focal center reveal that a surprisingly small portion of one’s visual field has any real clarity and precision. (See also Dennett 1991.)

b. Self-intimation

Another account of our privileged access stems from the doctrine of self-intimation. A mental state is self-intimating if it is impossible for a person to be in that mental state and not know that she is that mental state. This doctrine is sometimes referred to as omniscience (see Alston 1971); if whenever an individual is in a mental state she has knowledge of that mental state, then that individual is omniscient with respect to her own mental life. This doctrine is also sometimes referred to as the transparency thesis – the claim that whatever happens within a mind is completely transparent to it. (See Shoemaker 1990.) As such, the doctrine is closely associated with the Cartesian conception of the mind. But though Descartes himself seemed to endorse both infallibility and self-intimation, it is useful to note that they can come apart. An individual might be infallible about her mental states without the mental states being self-intimating; in such a case, whatever beliefs she has about her mental states will be true, but there may nonetheless be some mental states about which she has no beliefs. Likewise, even if mental states are self-intimating, we might still have false introspective beliefs. Self-intimation requires that whenever an individual is in a mental state she will form the belief that she is in that mental state, but it does not rule out her falsely forming the very same belief when she is not in that mental state.

Like the infallibility thesis, the self-intimation thesis enjoys some inherent plausibility. In fact, self-intimation may even seem to follow from the very notion of a mental state. If what it is for an individual to have a mental state is for her to be conscious of it, how could self-intimation be denied? Insofar as we think of the mental in terms of the conscious, and insofar as we think of being conscious of a mental state as being aware of it, the self-intimation thesis seems like a truism.

Unfortunately for the proponent of self-intimation, however, there are two obvious problems with this line of reasoning. First, as the work of Freud has suggested, we should not limit the mental to the conscious. Second, the claim that consciousness should be analyzed in terms of awareness is itself highly controversial. (See e.g., Armstrong 1981; Block 1995.)

This second point relates to Armstrong’s case (1981) of the distracted truck driver, which is often offered as an objection to the self-intimation thesis. When driving for long periods of time at night, a truck driver may suddenly “come to” and realize that he has been driving for quite some time without being aware of what he has been doing. Though the truck driver was clearly in a conscious state while he was driving (after all, he was engaging in a fairly sophisticated activity), he had no introspective awareness of that state.

The self-intimation thesis also falls victim to many of the same objections that plague the infallibility thesis. Just as we can have false beliefs about many of our mental states, we may also fail to form beliefs about many of our mental states. Even if the jealous lover does not falsely believe that she is not jealous, she might nonetheless fail to recognize her feelings of jealousy. In fact, the only way that we are able to explain much of human behavior is to assume that individuals often lack knowledge of their own mental states. Why do the hero and the heroine bicker so much, to return to an example from above? Presumably this occurs because they are unaware of their true feelings for one another.

The proponent of the self-intimation thesis may be able to sidestep some of these objections by limiting the scope of the thesis in an appropriate way. Chisholm (1981) offers a self-intimation thesis limited to conscious states about which an individual reflects, i.e., whenever an individual who is in a conscious state reflects on whether she is in such a state, she will form a justified belief that she is in such a state. In recent years Shoemaker has also championed a limited version of the self-intimation thesis: “it is implicit in the nature of certain mental states that any subject of such states that has the capacity to conceive of itself as having them will be aware of having them when it does, or at least will become aware of this under certain conditions (e.g. if it reflects on the matter).” (Shoemaker 1988; see also Shoemaker 1995.) The mental states that Shoemaker has in mind are beliefs and desires. Shoemaker argues for his version of the self-intimation thesis by invoking considerations of Moore’s Paradox. Named for G.E. Moore, the paradox concerns assertions of the form “P, but I don’t believe that P” (e.g. “It is raining but I don’t believe that it is raining.”) In short, Shoemaker argues that any rational individual who has the first-order belief P will be able to avoid holding Moore-paradoxical beliefs. Thus, assuming rationality, the mere possession of a belief is enough to ensure that an individual will believe that he has that belief. We will return to Shoemaker’s view in our discussion of the nature of introspection in Section 2.

c. Self-warrant

A third account of privileged access can be found in the notion of self-warrant. As Alston (1976) defines the notion, “a self-warranted belief enjoys an immunity from lack of justification; it cannot be the belief it is and fail to be justified.” If privileged access is to be understood in terms of self-warrant, then that would mean that whenever an individual has a belief about her own mental states, she is justified in holding that belief. As was the case with the infallibility claim, for this claim to be plausible it must presumably be limited to beliefs formed by introspection: if an individual believes on the basis of introspection that she is in a particular mental state, then her belief is justified.

Importantly, in contrast to the proponent of infallibility, the proponent of self-warrant does not claim that the relevant belief must be true. Self-warrant leaves open the possibility of error. As such, it is a considerably weaker claim than either of the two claims previously considered. Moreover, there is something intuitively plausible about it. Suppose that, on the basis on introspection, I form the belief I intend to go to the faculty meeting this afternoon. Granted, I might be wrong, and perhaps other people could supply me with evidence that would convince me that I am wrong. But that said, I have no reason to reject the belief. And that alone – when introspective beliefs are in question – seems to justify me in holding the belief. This point generalizes our introspective beliefs about other conscious mental states as well. Typically, nothing is required to justify an introspective belief about one’s own conscious mental state other than the fact that it is a belief about one’s own conscious mental state. As Alston (1976) argues, if someone were to report to us that she presently is imagining a blue jay, or that she is thinking about lunch, or that she has an itch on her left leg, then we take it for granted that these reports are justified; “We would unhesitatingly brand as absurd a request for justification such as ‘Why do you believe that?’, ‘What reason do you have for supposing that?’, or ‘How do you know that?’”

Against this, Gallois (1996) argues that invoking self-warrant cannot provide an adequate explanation of the epistemic distinctiveness of our introspective beliefs. Gallois suggests that ultimately there is no way of understanding self-warrant except in terms of non-evidential justification; any other analysis will lead to the implausible conclusion that all beliefs are self-warranted. But that means that what is really doing the work to explain the distinctive epistemic nature of our introspective knowledge is the fact that it is non-evidentially justified – the notion of self-warrant itself does no explanatory work. Non-evidential justification will be discussed in connection with the notion of immediacy, below.

d. Immediacy

An additional claim that is often made about an individual’s introspective access to her own mental states is that it is immediate or direct. To claim that introspective access is immediate is to claim that our introspective beliefs are non-inferential and non-evidentially based. In this respect, our introspective beliefs are significantly different from perceptual beliefs (and perhaps, from all of our other beliefs as well).

Immediacy is often linked with infallibility. One reason that introspective beliefs might be thought to be infallible is that they are immediate; the fact that they are not inferred from any other beliefs or based on any other evidence bestows on them an immunity from error. This position is often associated with Russell, and in particular, his distinction between knowledge by description and knowledge by acquaintance: “We shall say that we have acquaintance with anything of which we are directly aware, without the intermediary of any process of inference or any knowledge of truths.” (Russell 1912) For Russell, the only things with which we have such acquaintance are our current mental particulars, and when we are acquainted with some such particular – when our access to it is immediate – our judgments about it cannot be wrong:

At any given moment, there are certain things of which a man is ‘aware,’ certain things which are ‘before his mind.’ … If I describe these objects, I may of course describe them wrongly, hence I cannot with certainty communicate to another what are the things of which I am aware. But if I speak to myself, and denote them by what may be called ‘proper names,’ rather than by descriptive words, I cannot be in error. (Russell 1910.)

Leaving aside the question of whether Russell is right to connect immediacy with infallibility, a further question remains: can immediacy provide us with an adequate understanding of privileged access? Many philosophers have argued that it cannot. For example, Alston (1971) complains that the notion of immediate awareness is not well-understood. It will not help to try to comprehend the notion in causal or special terms, since we do not have a good sense of how these notions apply to mental states. He suggests further that even once the notion is clarified, it still will not serve to explain our privileged access. (Alston 1976). The primary problem concerns the following question: What, exactly, are we supposed to have immediate awareness of? Alston notes that we can have awareness of particulars (my sensation of this patch of color) or facts (that this patch of color is red). But since we do not enjoy privileged access with respect to all of our beliefs about the particular, it looks as if immediate awareness to particulars cannot do the work that it is supposed to do. The problem does not arise if our immediate awareness is of a particular fact about the particular – an immediate awareness of the fact that this patch of color is red can explain why a belief in that fact would be epistemically privileged. However, here we have merely traded one problem for another, since it is not at all clear what sense it makes to say that facts can be immediately apprehended.

Heil (1988) offers an additional reason to deny that immediacy or directness gives us a sufficient explanation of privileged access. According to Heil, a mental state’s being one’s own is neither necessary nor sufficient for it to be knowable directly. It is possible, in principle, that I might fail to know many of my mental states directly, and it might further be possible that I might know someone else’s mental states directly. (Suppose, for example, that Anne could be wired in such a way so that she is connected to Emily’s nervous system. In this case, Anne might know Emily’s mental states directly.) As he concludes, “a characterization of my privileged access based exclusively on what is directly known is anemic, hence unsatisfactory.”

2. The Nature of Introspection

However we are to understand the special epistemic status of our introspective judgments, we might naturally think that this status owes to the nature of introspection. But what is the nature of our introspective capacity? Philosophers who have attempted to answer this question fall, broadly speaking, into two camps: those who give observational models of introspection, and those who give non-observational models of introspection. In what follows, we address each of these accounts in turn. We will also briefly consider the skeptical view of an additional camp of philosophers, those who deny that there is any special introspective capacity for which to account.

a. Observational Models

One of the most common accounts of introspection is modeled on perception: just as our perceptual capacity enables us to observe the outer world, our introspective capacity enables us to observe the inner world. As such, introspection can be thought of as an inner sense. This view is often thought to have originated with Locke, who claimed that one source of our ideas is:

the Perception of the Operations of our own Minds within us …. This Source of Ideas, every Man has wholly in himself: And though it be not Sense, as having nothing to do with external Objects; yet it is very like it, and might properly enough be call’d internal Sense. (Locke 1689/1975)

Armstrong (1968, 1981) is probably the main contemporary advocate of the inner sense view. In the course of advocating a materialist theory of mind, Armstrong advances a view of introspection as a self-scanning process in the brain. According to Armstrong, the scanning state and the state scanned must be distinct states: “although they are both mental states, it is impossible that the introspecting and the thing introspected should be one and the same mental state. A mental state cannot be aware of itself, any more than a man can eat himself up.” (Armstrong 1968, 324) Having offered this consideration, which is often referred to as the distinct existences argument, Armstrong also argues that the relationship between the two states is causal.

Given this picture of introspection, it is no surprise that proponents of the inner sense view typically reject several of the claims discussed in Section 1 above. Since they view the introspective state and the introspected state as distinct states, they claim that it must be possible for one to occur without the other. Thus, they reject the self-intimation claim. Since it seems possible that the scanning mechanism could malfunction, they also reject the infallibility claim.

This does not mean, however, that the inner sense view of introspection should be seen as deflationary. Lycan (1996), who offers a version of Armstrong’s self-scanning view, emphasizes the importance of introspection to our mental lives: “Introspective consciousness is no accident … As a matter of engineering, if we did not have the devices of introspection, there would be no we to argue about, or to do the arguing.” Here Lycan stresses the evolutionary advantages conferred by our capacity for introspection. The complexity of our sensory, cognitive and motor systems demands that we be able to engage in an internal monitoring of these systems.

In recent years, Shoemaker has been one of the most persistent critics of the inner sense model of introspection. According to Shoemaker (1994), if introspection were to conform to a perceptual model, even one broadly construed, then it would have to satisfy two conditions. The first is what he calls the “causal condition” – introspective beliefs about one’s own mental states are caused by those mental states, by a reliable belief-producing mechanism. The second is what he calls the “independence condition” – the existence of mental states is independent of any introspective beliefs about them. Shoemaker’s main concern with the inner sense model is that introspection fails to satisfy this second condition. His arguments here relate to his arguments for the self-intimation thesis, discussed above. According to Shoemaker, rationality demands that a creature be sensitive to her own mental states, and thus it is of the essence of mental states to reveal themselves to introspection. (See also Falvey 2000.)

Many of the additional criticisms of the inner sense view stem from alleged disanalogies with “outer” sense. For example, there is no organ of introspection the way that there are organs of sense perception. Armstrong (1968) dismisses this criticism by noting that even one of the outer senses – namely, proprioception – proceeds without a sensory organ. Lormand (2000) makes the further point that there are mental processes such as imagination, dreaming, and hallucination that we think of as “sensory” even though they do not proceed by way of organs of perception.

Another disanalogy arises from the fact that introspecting lacks any distinctive phenomenology. Lyons (1986) takes this to show that it cannot literally be a form of inner perception. Each of our other senses has a distinct phenomenology; think, for example, of the phenomenology of tasting or of touching. However, the phenomenology of introspecting seems to derive wholly from what is being introspected; in and of itself, there is nothing that it is like to introspect.

This last criticism relates to the so-called diaphanousness or transparency of experience (not to be confused with the epistemic transparency claim discussed above that is associated with the Cartesian conception of mind). Experience is said to be transparent in the sense that we ‘see’ right through it to the object of that experience, analogously to the way we see through a pane of glass to whatever is on the other side of it. For example, when I am having an experience of a red tomato, and I try to focus on the experience, there seems to be nothing on which I can train my focus except the tomato itself. If experience is transparent in this way, then introspection is not a matter of “looking within.”

Moved by considerations of experiential transparency, some philosophers – most notably Dretske (1995, 1999) – have offered a perceptual model of introspection that differs dramatically from the inner sense view. Dretske claims that all mental states are representational states. But this means that there is no longer any need, or any use, for the sort of internal scanning mechanism posited by proponents of the inner sense view. Instead:

One becomes aware of representational facts by an awareness of physical objects. One learns that A looks longer than B, not by an awareness of the experience that represents A as longer than B, but by an awareness of A and B, the objects the experience is an experience of. On a representational theory of the mind, introspection becomes an instance of displaced perception—knowledge of internal (mental) facts via an awareness of external (physical) facts. (Dretske 1995)

On this displaced perception view, then, not only should we reject the infallibility thesis and the self-intimation thesis, but we should also reject the immediacy thesis. Introspective knowledge for someone like Dretske will be inferential knowledge – inferred from our knowledge of the external world.

In addition to the displaced perception view, there are other views that are at least broadly speaking observational views of introspection but yet deny that introspection should be construed along the lines of the traditional inner sense view. For example, Nichols and Stich (2003a, 2003b; see also Nichols 2000) have offered a view of introspection that works by way of a “monitoring mechanism.” The input to the mechanism is one’s own mental state; the output is a belief that one has that mental state. As stated, the monitoring mechanism sounds very much like Armstrong’s self-scanning mechanism, and thus looks like a version of the inner sense model of introspection. However, the view proposed by Stich and Nichols differs from standard versions of the inner sense view in its explicit denial that the monitoring mechanism detects the presence of the inputted mental state by way of phenomenological features.

b. Non-Observational Models

In the previous section, we saw Shoemaker’s criticisms of the inner-sense model of introspection. Having developed these criticisms, Shoemaker (1988, 1990, 1994) offers his own view of how introspection works. This view is not observational. Rather, on Shoemaker’s view, there is a constitutive connection between being in a mental state and having introspective knowledge about that state: “Our minds are so constituted, or our brains are so wired, that for a wide range of mental states, one’s being in a certain mental state produces in one, under certain conditions, the belief that one is in that mental state.” (Shoemaker 1994)

For Shoemaker, this constitutive connection owes to the fact that we are rational creatures. It is an essential part of being rational that a being has the capacity for introspection. Shoemaker argues for this by primarily by invoking considerations of Moore’s Paradox (see above; section 1c). This argument aims to show that ‘self-blindness’ is not possible; in order to explain an individual’s possession of an introspective belief about a given mental state, we need only to invoke the fact that the individual has the relevant mental state plus normal intelligence, rationality, and conceptual capacity.

A similar account is offered by Gallois (1996), who argues that whenever I have a justified belief, I am entitled to infer from what I believe to the fact that I so believe it. This non-evidential inference will be made by any rational creature, since it is the only way that we can make sense of the world around us; in the absence of such an inference, an individual will not be able to contrast her beliefs about the world with the world as it actually is. What would result, according to Gallois, is an irrational view of the world around us. Thus, rationality demands the self-attribution of beliefs. Gallois then offers related considerations to show that rationality also demands the self-attribution of other mental states. For example, unless we attribute perceptual states to ourselves, we will be unable to contrast how the world appears to us with how it actually is.

Obviously, the plausibility of the sort of non-observational account that Shoemaker and Gallois offer will depend on the notion of rationality involved. Additionally, proponents of this sort of non-observational account must defend themselves against charges of circularity. Briefly put, the charge of circularity arises since it might naturally be thought that an adequate account of rationality will have to make reference to our introspective capacity. (See Kind 2003 and Siewert 2003 for criticisms of Shoemaker’s account.)

The Theory Theory of self-awareness (TTSA) offers a very different kind of non-observational model. TTSA derives directly from the “Theory Theory,” a view which claims that an individual’s network of commonsense folk-psychological beliefs constitute a theory which she uses to explain and predict the behavior of others. Typically, this inferential, theory-based understanding that we achieve of others’ mental states is contrasted with the direct, non-inferential understanding that we can have of our own mental states. Recent results from developmental psychology, however, call this contrast into question. For example, Gopnik (1993; see also Gopnik and Meltzoff 1994) presents evidence that very young children make errors about their own psychological states parallel to the kinds of errors that they make about others’ psychological states. These errors are not easily explained if we assume a sharp divide between the way we come to know about our own mental states and the way we come to know about others’ mental states. Gopnik thus concludes that the child’s theory of mind applies not only to others but to herself as well:

The important point is that the theoretical constructs themselves, and particularly the idea of intentionality, are not the result of some direct first-person apprehension that is then applied to others. Rather, they are the result of a cognitive construction. The child constructs a theory that explains a wide variety of facts about the child’s experience and behavior and about the behavior and language of others.

Recent research on autism and schizophrenia is also often cited by proponents of TTSA. For example, Carruthers (1996b) discusses experimental results suggesting that autistic individuals lack introspective access to many of their own current mental states. If we think of autism as a kind of “mind-blindness,” then these results are exactly what would be predicted by TTSA.

In developing his own version of TTSA, however, Carruthers (1996a) departs from Gopnik’s claim that self-knowledge is inferential. Rather, Carruthers thinks that mental states should be thought of as akin to the theoretical entities of physics; they are the theoretical entities of folk psychology. Introspection should likewise be thought of as akin to the kind of theory-laden perception that often goes on in the physical sciences. For example, armed with the appropriate background information, a physicist might sometimes simply see that electrons are being emitted by the substance that she is studying. Likewise, claims Carruthers, each of us can sometimes simply see – “that is, know intuitively and non-inferentially” – what mental states we have. Depending on what sense we make of Carruthers invocation of “seeing” here, this version of the TTSA might be best classified as an observational model of introspection (though obviously one that is quite different from the traditional inner-sense view).

Opponents of this view typically raise two very different sorts of criticisms. First, they criticize the data for the theory, suggesting that the research from developmental psychology does not in fact support the conclusions that proponents of TTSA want to draw. For example, Nichols (2000) argues that there are developmental asynchronies between a child’s ability to posit knowledge and ignorance to herself and her ability to posit knowledge and ignorance to others. Were TTSA to be true, however, we should expect these abilities to develop in parallel. Second, they criticize the theory itself. For example, Nichols and Stich (2003b) argue that the theory is underdescribed in one very critical respect. For TTSA to be plausible, the proponent has to allow that there is special information available in the first-person case that is not available in the third-person case. But proponents of TTSA have no plausible account of what this special information might be. Consider Gopnik’s remark that “we may well be equipped to detect certain kinds of internal cognitive activity in a vague and unspecified way, what we might call ‘the Cartesian buzz’.” (Gopnik 1993) Stich and Nichols reasonably note that the postulation of some mysterious ‘buzz’ does not offer much help in this regard.

c. Skepticism about Introspection

Many philosophers who take a skeptical view towards introspection were influenced by the views of Wittgenstein. Wittgenstein is often associated with a view called expressivism about introspection, i.e., the claim that what appear to be introspective reports of our mental states are in fact not reports at all, but rather mere expressions of those mental states. Saying “I am in pain” is akin to saying “ouch.” As expressions, rather than reports, of one’s pain, neither of these utterances has any propositional content. Such expressions, in other words, are non-cognitive. This view parallels expressivism in ethics, where utterances like “Giving money to charity is morally right” and “Killing an innocent person is wrong” are interpreted as expressions of approval and disapproval. Whether Wittgenstein actually was an expressivist about introspection is, as is often the case with Wittgensteinian interpretation, a complicated and controversial exegetical question. But certainly some of his remarks are at least suggestive of expressivism, as for example when he says: “the verbal expression of pain replaces crying and does not describe it.” (Wittgenstein 1958)

It is worth noting that some philosophers have recently embraced expressivism without embracing skepticism about introspection. The basic line is to divorce expressivism from non-cognitivism, i.e., to deny that mental state self-ascriptions are reports without denying that such self-ascriptions can be judged true or false. In this spirit, Falvey (2000) argues that the denial that mental state self-ascriptions are reports amounts only to the denial of the observational model of introspection. Mental state self-ascriptions can be truth-apt even if they are mere expressions. His subsequent account of self-knowledge hinges on the notion of sincerity of utterance. According to Falvey, when an individual sincerely self-ascribes a mental state, the sincerity of her utterance will guarantee that she is in that mental state. Although Falvey recognizes that in general the sincerity of an utterance is not sufficient for the truth of that utterance, he argues that mental state self-ascriptions are special in that the gap between sincerity and truth collapses. Moreover, the absence of this gap is what explains privileged access. (See Bar-On 2005 for a different version of neo-expressivism.)

An additional source of skepticism about introspection comes from the rejection of the Cartesian picture of the mind. Cartesianism encourages us to think of the mind like a theater in which the ongoing show can be viewed by only one individual, the person whose mind it is. Critics of Cartesianism suggest that this picture seduces us into falsely positing a faculty for viewing the show, i.e., a faculty of introspection. Along with the rejection of Cartesianism, they urge the rejection of any commitment to a faculty of introspection.

One such critic is Ryle, who argues that the standard philosophical view of introspection is a logical mess. (Ryle 1949) His primary criticism takes the form of a regress argument. On the standard view, self-knowledge consists in a higher-order attention to some lower-order state. But this entails that we would also have to attend to the higher-order state. And the situation is actually even worse than this, since the state of attending to that higher-order state would itself have to be attended to, and so on, leading to a vicious infinite regress.

Importantly, in rejecting introspection, Ryle does not deny that we can attain self-knowledge. We can achieve self-knowledge exactly the same way that we can achieve knowledge of other people, namely, by drawing inductive conclusions on the basis of observed behavior. As this suggests, skepticism about introspection goes along with a rejection of privileged access. On Ryle’s view, there is nothing epistemically special about our judgments about our own mental states. In fact, not only do we typically fail to be in a better position to make judgments about our own mental states than about others’ mental states, or than the position others are in with respect to one’s own mental states, but we might on occasion be in a worse position. After all, one is often inclined to view one’s self with a considerable lack of objectivity.

In a similar spirit to Ryle’s account of introspection is Lyons’ (1986) “replay” account of introspection, according to which introspection is simply a process of perceptual replay. For example, if someone introspects in order to determine whether she is angry at her colleague, Lyons claim that what she will do is to call to mind the things that she did when she was last with the colleague, – what she said, how she reacted, etc. In sum, for Lyons introspection “is not a special and privileged executive monitoring process, over and above the more plebeian processes or perception, memory, and imagination; it is those processes put to a certain use.”

Dennett, one of Ryle’s most famous students, is also skeptical of standard views of introspection. According to Dennett, in many instances where we think we are introspecting, we are actually theorizing. (Dennett 1991) Moreover, since we are notoriously bad at this theorizing, our first-person access to our own mental states is considerably less privileged than is commonly thought.

3. Introspection and the Nature of Mind

Having discussed the epistemic status and the nature of introspection, we now turn briefly to two claims about introspection which have played significant roles in discussions of the nature of mind. First, we discuss whether introspection can provide a criterion of mentality. Second, we discuss whether introspection can provide support for a dualist answer to the mind-body problem. Both of these claims are associated with Descartes, and both have come under fire in recent discussions of philosophy of mind.

a. Introspectibility as a Mark of the Mental

In claiming that the mind is transparent, Descartes was in essence making a claim about the scope of introspection: the introspective capacity has complete access to all of the contents of the mind. This gives rise to a further claim associated with a Cartesian conception of mind, namely, that introspectibility is the mark of the mental. For Descartes, there is nothing to the mind but that which is accessible to introspection.

In making this claim, Descartes should not be seen as committed to the implausibly strong view that a state must actually be introspected in order to count as a mental state. An individual can have mental states that, at any particular moment, are not present to her consciousness. For example, of the many beliefs that an individual holds, only a very few are occurrent at any point and time. Most of them are non-occurrent – they are standing beliefs that are recalled to consciousness only when needed. Take your belief that 6+7=13; presumably, before reading the previous sentence, that belief was not present to your consciousness. But the fact that it was not then being introspected does not incline us to deny that you then held the belief.

The accessibility that Descartes has in mind is accessibility in principle. Although prior to reading the sentence above you were not introspectively accessing your belief that 6+7=13, you could in principle have introspectively accessed that belief at any time. A belief remains introspectively accessible in principle even if there are many moments in time in which the belief is not being introspected. You might have some mental states to which it is more difficult to gain introspective access. In some cases it might require careful reflection; in other cases, it might even require some kind of psychoanalysis. But as long as the state can, in principle, be brought to consciousness, Descartes counts the relevant state as mental.

The problem, however, is that there are some states that we intuitively think of as mental states but that seem even in principle inaccessible to introspection. At least since the work of Freud, we have recognized the existence of mental states that are deeply unconsciousness. There can be some desires, for example, that are so deeply repressed that they cannot be made available to introspection even with the best psychoanalysis that money can buy. Such states, in other words, are not even in principle accessible to introspection.

With some slight tweaking to our accessibility-in-principle claim, it might be possible to avoid this problem. For example, Brook and Stainton (2000) offer the following suggestion. Consider some deeply unconscious states that we are assuming are not even introspectively accessible in principle. In other words, no matter how hard you were to try, you could not bring them to introspective awareness. Nonetheless: “were you to become aware of them, (directly aware of them, not aware of them by inferring them from behavior or something else), it would be by becoming able to introspect them.” The only way you could have direct access to such states, in other words, would be through introspection.

Even this suggestion, however, is not enough to save the claim that introspectibility is the mark of the mental. First of all, it is not clear how we should evaluate the above counterfactual conditional, given that the mental states in question are ex hypothesi inaccessible to introspection. Second of all, there is another class of mental states for which it is even harder to make sense of the supposition that we could become aware of them directly. Consider here any states that are typically thought to be at the “sub-personal” level. For example, if we accept Chomsky’s theory of language acquisition, each of us mentally represents all sorts of basic linguistic rules. These representations, however, are inaccessible in principle to introspection. Moreover, these states – unlike the sorts of repressed desires just considered – do not even seem to be suitable targets for introspective awareness.

For these reasons, it is unlikely that we will be able to use introspectibility as a criterion of the mental. Perhaps introspectibility can serve as a sufficient condition for a state’s being a mental state, but it cannot provide us with a necessary condition. Despite what Descartes thought, our mental life seems to outrun our introspective capacity.

b. Introspective Arguments for Dualism

In the Second Meditation, Descartes (1641) presents the famous line of reasoning often referred to as the Cogito – I think, therefore I am. Even if a powerful demon were to deceive me about the external world, “he will never bring it about that I am nothing so long as I think that I am something.” And so Descartes concludes that he can be certain that he exists.

Having achieved certainty about his existence, however, Descartes does not yet have any certain knowledge about what kind of being he is. He then goes on to examine the nature of the human mind. The course of this examination has suggested the following argument:

  1. Descartes cannot doubt that he (his mind) exists.
  2. Descartes can doubt that his body exists.
  3. Descartes’ mind is not the same thing as Descartes’ body, i.e., dualism is true.

Whether Descartes intended to be using the reflections of the Second Meditation to be offering this argument for dualism is a thorny exegetical question that we sidestep here. For our purposes, the question is whether these considerations do support dualism. More specifically, we are interested in closely related considerations that specifically invoke introspection:

  1. Mental states are known by introspection.
  2. Brain states are not known by introspection.
  3. Therefore, mental states are not identical to brain states.

According to Leibniz’ Law, if a has a property that b lacks, then a is not identical to b. Here we seem to have found a property that mental states have that brain states lack, namely, that they are known by introspection. Unfortunately for the dualist, however, this argument commits an intensional fallacy. For Leibniz’ Law to apply, the property in question must be extensional, that is, it must apply to an object independently of how we refer to that object. In this case, the property “is known by” fails to be extensional.

Faced with this objection, the dualist might offer the following amended argument:

  1. Mental states are knowable by introspection.
  2. Brain states are not knowable by introspection.
  3. Therefore, mental states are not identical to brain states.

The dualist can plausibly claim that the property invoked by this argument – being knowable by introspection – is a genuine, extensional property, and thus he can avoid the intensional fallacy committed by the previous argument. But this argument falls victim to a related objection, as explicated by Churchland (1985). According to Churchland, the materialist has no reason to accept premise 2: “if mental states are indeed identical with brain states, then it is really brain states that we have been introspecting all along, though without appreciating their fine-grained nature.” The fact that temperature is identical to mean molecular kinetic energy means that we can sense mean molecular kinetic energy by feeling, whether we realize that’s what we’re sensing by feeling or not. The fact that we don’t realize that we can introspect brain states does not mean that mental states are not identical to brain states.

In contemporary discussions of the mind-body problem, the above argument from introspection has not played much of a role. However, related considerations from introspection are still in play. For example, Chalmers (1996) offers an argument from “epistemic asymmetry” to show that consciousness cannot be reductively explained. According to this argument:

Our grounds for belief in consciousness derive solely from our own experience of it. Even if we knew every last detail about the physics of the universe … that information would not lead us to postulate the existence of conscious experience. My knowledge of consciousness, in the first instance, comes from my own case, not from any external observations. It is my first-person experience of consciousness that forces the problem on me.

Although this passage (and Chalmers’ discussion of the argument) does not specifically mention introspection, it seems clear that the way one gains first-person experience of consciousness is through introspection.

More generally, many of the contemporary arguments offered in discussions of the mind-body problem rely on premises that can only be supported by introspection, or by introspective projection. Consider, for example, Jackson’s Knowledge Argument. Mary, who is locked in a black and white room and has never had any color sensations, learns every physical fact there is about color. Nonetheless, claims Jackson, when she leaves the room and sees a ripe tomato for the first time, she will learn some new fact about the color red. Thus, there are facts that escape the physicalist story. (Jackson 1982) Whether or not this argument succeeds in establishing the falsity of physicalism is hotly debated, but for our purposes, what’s most important is the following question: how can we judge the truth of Jackson’s claim that Mary learns (or even seems to learn) a new fact about color when she leaves the room? What we must do, it seems, is to imagine ourselves in Mary’s position and judge what we think our epistemic position would be upon exiting the room. In other words, we engage in a sort of introspective projection. In this way, introspection continues to play a key role in this and many other arguments relating to the mind-body problem.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. 1963. “Is Introspective Knowledge Incorrigible?” The Philosophical Review 72: 417-432.
  • Armstrong, D. 1968. A Materialist Theory of Mind. Humanities Press.
  • Armstrong, D. 1981. The Nature of Mind and Other Essays. Cornell University Press.
  • Alston, W. 1971. “Varieties of Privileged Access.” American Philosophical Quarterly 8: 223-241.
  • Alston, W. 1976. “Self-Warrant: A Neglected Form of Privileged Access.” American Philosophical Quarterly 13: 257-272.
  • Bar-On, D. 2005. Speaking My Mind: Expression and Self-Knowledge. Oxford University Press.
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Author Information

Amy Kind
Claremont McKenna College

U. S. A.

Knowledge Argument Against Physicalism

The Knowledge Argument Against Physicalism

The knowledge argument is one of the main challenges to physicalism, the doctrine that the world is entirely physical. The argument begins with the claim that there are truths about consciousness that cannot be deduced from the complete physical truth. For example, Frank Jackson’s Mary learns all the physical truths from within a black-and-white room. Then she leaves the room, sees a red tomato for the first time, and learns new truths—new phenomenal truths about what it is like to see red. The arguer infers that, contrary to physicalism, the complete physical truth is not the whole truth. The physical truth does not determine or metaphysically necessitate the whole truth about the world.

This article discusses that argument’s structure, compares Jackson’s version with others, compares the knowledge argument with other anti-physicalist arguments, and summarizes the main lines of response. Eight controversial assumptions are identified. These are the assumptions that:

  • the notion of the physical is coherent;
  • the complete physical truth is accessible to the pre-release Mary;
  • upon leaving the room, she learns something;
  • the kind of knowledge she acquires upon leaving the room is informational knowledge, rather than ability knowledge, acquaintance knowledge, or something else;
  • she gains new information, rather than old information represented in a new way;
  • if the complete-knowledge claim and the learning claim are true, then what Mary learns when she leaves the room cannot be a priori deduced (deduced by reason alone, without empirical investigation) from the complete physical truth.
  • if there are phenomenal truths that cannot be a priori deduced from the complete physical truth, then the complete physical truth does not metaphysically necessitate those phenomenal truths;
  • the knowledge argument and epiphenomenalism are consistent.

Various criticisms and defenses of these assumptions are discussed.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Knowledge Intuition and the Inference to Physicalism’s Falsity
  3. Related Arguments
  4. More Physicalist Responses
  5. Non Physicalist Responses
  6. Other Responses
  7. Jackson’s Retraction
  8. Summary of Assumptions and Criticisms
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The knowledge argument aims to refute physicalism, the doctrine that the world is entirely physical. Physicalism (also known as materialism) is widely accepted in contemporary philosophy. But some doubt that phenomenal consciousness—experience, the subjective aspect of the mind—is physical. The knowledge argument articulates one of the main forms this doubt has taken.

Frank Jackson gives the argument its classic statement (in Jackson 1982 and Jackson 1986). He formulates the argument in terms of Mary, the super-scientist. Her story takes place in the future, when all physical facts have been discovered. These include “everything in completed physics, chemistry, and neurophysiology, and all there is to know about the causal and relational facts consequent upon all this, including of course functional roles” (Jackson 1982, p. 51). She learns all this by watching lectures on a monochromatic television monitor. But she spends her life in a black-and-white room and has no color experiences. Then she leaves the room and sees colors for the first time. Based on this case, Jackson argues roughly as follows. If physicalism were true, then Mary would know everything about human color vision before leaving the room. But intuitively, it would seem that she learns something new when she leaves. She learns what it’s like to see colors, that is, she learns about qualia, the properties that characterize what it’s like. Her new phenomenal knowledge includes knowledge of truths. Therefore, physicalism is false.

In the late 1990’s, Jackson changed his mind: he now defends physicalism and rejects the knowledge argument. But others defend the argument, and even those who reject it often disagree about where it goes awry. The knowledge argument has inspired a voluminous literature, which contains insights about consciousness, knowledge, the limits of third-person science, and the nature of the physical. It is also discussed in non philosophical works, including a book by E. O. Wilson (1998), a work of fiction (Lodge 2001), and a T.V. series (Brainspotting). This article discusses the argument’s structure, compares Jackson’s version with others, compares the knowledge argument with other anti-physicalist arguments, and summarizes the main lines of response.

2. The Knowledge Intuition and the Inference to Physicalism’s Falsity

The knowledge argument has two parts. One says that physical knowledge is not sufficient for phenomenal knowledge. Call this the knowledge intuition (Stoljar and Nagasawa, 2004). The other says that the knowledge intuition entails the falsity of physicalism.

Thus described, the knowledge argument is not new with Jackson. Locke and other 18th Century British empiricists discussed the knowledge intuition. C. D. Broad gave a version of the knowledge argument in 1925. And other versions appear in more recent writings, such as Thomas Nagel’s 1974 “What is it Like to be a Bat?” What is distinctive about Jackson’s contribution?

Daniel Stoljar and Yujin Nagasawa (2004) answer this question in their introduction to a volume of essays on the knowledge argument. As they say, Jackson contributes at least two main ideas: his Mary example illustrates the knowledge intuition better than previous attempts; and he provides distinctive reasons for inferring physicalism’s falsity from the intuition. Let us take these points in order.

The Mary case divides the knowledge intuition into three claims:

  • The complete-knowledge claim: before leaving the room, Mary knows everything physical.
  • The learning claim: upon leaving, she learns something.
  • The non-deducibility claim: if the complete-knowledge claim and the learning claim are true, then what Mary learns when she leaves the room cannot be a priori deduced (deduced by reason alone, without empirical investigation) from the complete physical truth.

Physicalists may deny the knowledge intuition. But the Mary case suggests that doing so requires rejecting the complete-knowledge claim, the learning claim, or the non-deducibility claim.

The cases discussed by Broad, Nagel, and others do not deliver this result. Consider, for example, Broad’s “mathematical archangel,” a logically omniscient creature who knows all the physical truths about various chemical compounds. Broad calls these truths “mechanistic” instead of “physical,” but the point is the same. On his view, the archangel would know all such truths but still lack phenomenal knowledge concerning, for example, “the peculiar smell of ammonia.” And Broad infers that physicalism (“mechanism”) is false. But what if the physicalist denies that the archangel would lack the relevant phenomenal knowledge? We appear to be at an impasse. By contrast, if the physicalist claims that, while in the room, Mary knows what it’s like to see colors, he must explain why she seems to acquire this knowledge when she leaves. The Mary case breaks the deadlock in favor of the knowledge intuition. Other illustrations of the intuition that precede Jackson’s have further drawbacks. For example, Nagel’s claim that humans cannot imagine what it’s like to be a bat raises distracting issues about the limits of human imagination, about which physicalism carries no obvious commitments. Mary’s fame is just.

To explain the second of Jackson’s distinctive contributions, it will be useful to explain some terminology and abbreviations. First, there is the distinction between the a priori and the a posteriori. A priori truths are those that are justifiable by reason alone, without empirical investigation. Logical truths provide clear examples. For example, one can figure out without empirical investigation that the following claim is true: if Socrates is mortal, then either Socrates is mortal or Socrates is fat. Compare the claim that Socrates is mortal. While we believe the latter claim to be true, reason alone does not justify this belief. Instead, we rely on experience—empirical investigation. So, while it is a priori that if Socrates is mortal, then either Socrates is mortal or Socrates is fat, it is a posteriori that Socrates is mortal. We may also speak of truths that are a priori deducible from other truths. For example, although “Socrates is mortal” is a posteriori, that same truth is a priori deducible from two other truths: “All men are mortal” and “Socrates is a man.” In other words, the latter two truths, taken together, a priori entail that Socrates is mortal.

Second, there is the notion of metaphysically necessary truths. A necessary truth is a truth that could not have failed to be the case. Logical truths again provide clear examples: “Either Socrates is mortal or it is not the case that Socrates is moral” is usually regarded as necessary. Contrast that truth with “Socrates is mortal.” The latter is not necessary. Truths that are not necessary are also known as contingent. Philosophers often distinguish between different strengths or kinds of necessity. For example, there is arguably a sense in which it is a necessary truth that pigs cannot fly like birds. But if the laws of nature were different, then perhaps pigs would be able to fly like birds. So, perhaps it is not metaphysically impossible that pigs should be able to fly like birds. A metaphysically necessary truth is a truth that is necessary in the strictest possible sense: a truth that holds not just because of contingent laws of nature. Saul Kripke (1972) famously argues that there are metaphysically necessary truths that are not truths of pure logic. Indeed, he argues that there are metaphysically necessary truths that are not a priori. For example, on his view, that water is H2O is metaphysically necessary but a posteriori. He recognizes that there could have been substances that resemble water—substances that share water’s superficial qualities, such as its taste and visual appearance—but with a different molecular structure. But, he argues, these substances would not be water.

Third, let us introduce some abbreviations. On Jackson’s version of the knowledge argument, the assumption that Mary knows the complete physical truth about the world does not guarantee that she will be able to figure out the complete truth about human color vision. His reasoning involves the idea of the complete physical truth. Call the complete physical truth P. P can be seen as a long conjunction of all the particular physical truths, which, according to Jackson, Mary learns from watching science lectures. What about the truths that, according to Jackson, Mary does not learn until she leaves the room? Those would be included in the psychological truths about the world. Call the complete psychological truth Q. Finally, consider what Stoljar and Nagasawa call “the psychophysical conditional”: if P then Q, where P is the complete physical truth and Q is the complete psychological truth. As we will see, part of Jackson’s reasoning can be understood in terms of his view about the psychophysical conditional.

We are now in a position to state the second of Jackson’s distinctive contributions to the discussion of the knowledge argument. This contribution concerns his inference from the knowledge intuition to physicalism’s falsity. His inference assumes that if physicalism is true then the complete truth about human color vision is a priori deducible from the complete physical truth. But here a problem arises: why accept this assumption? Consider the psychophysical conditional, if P then Q (again, P is the complete physical truth and Q is the complete psychological truth). As Jackson conceives of physicalism, physicalism entails that the psychophysical conditional is a priori. If he is right, then all truths about color vision would be deducible from P (the complete physical truth). But here physicalists have a natural, obvious response: why not instead characterize physicalism as a Kripkean a posteriori necessity, akin to water is H2O? On this characterization, the psychophysical conditional is metaphysically necessary but not a priori.

In later work, Jackson criticizes this response. His argument is complex, but the basic idea is simple enough. In a 1995 “Postscript,” he reasons as follows. Consider the argument:

H2O covers most of the planet.
Therefore, water covers most of the planet.

The premise necessitates, but does not a priori entail, the conclusion. But, Jackson asks, why is there no a priori entailment? On his view, there is no such entailment because the argument’s premise gives us only part of the physical story. It is also part of the physical story that H2O does the other things that water does, that is, that H2O plays the water role. Playing the water role includes such things as being a substance that occupies oceans and lakes, looks clear to us, has little or no taste, is referred to as “water”, etc. So, let us add the following premise to the argument displayed above:

H2O plays the water role.

Now, says Jackson, the premises do a priori entail the conclusion. Moral: “a rich enough story about the H2O way things are does enable the a priori deduction of the water way things are” (Jackson 1995, p. 413). Likewise, physicalism entails that “knowing a rich enough story about the physical nature of our world is tantamount to knowing the psychological story about our world” (Jackson 1995, p. 414). But if physicalism is true, P should provide just that: a rich enough story. Thus, Jackson concludes, physicalism entails the apriority of the psychophysical conditional after all.

Jackson’s argument is controversial. But in developing it, he fills an important lacuna in the knowledge argument and thereby improves on earlier versions. Others, too, have attempted to fill this lacuna. Most notably, David Chalmers (1996, 2003, 2004, and 2006a) has given sophisticated arguments to this end, which are partly inspired by Jackson’s argument.

3. Related Arguments

The knowledge argument is one of several ways to articulate the suspicion that phenomenal consciousness is not physical. Another common way of articulating the doubt is through the conceivability argument. This argument descends from René Descartes’ main argument for mind-body substance dualism. He argued that, since he can clearly and distinctly conceive of his mind without his body and his body without his mind, they can exist without each other and are therefore distinct substances.

Contemporary versions of the conceivability argument usually rely on thought experiments concerning qualia. One such thought experiment involves inverted qualia. It seems conceivable that there be an individual exactly like me, except he and I are red/green inverted. We are physically and functionally identical, but the color experiences he has when viewing a ripe tomato (in normal light, without special contact lenses, and so forth) resemble the color experiences I have when viewing a ripe zucchini, and vice versa. Such a person would be my inverted twin. Likewise, it seems conceivable that there be a world exactly like ours in all physical and functional respects but without phenomenal consciousness. Creatures that lack consciousness but are physically and functionally identical to ordinary human beings are called zombies. If it is conceivable that there be creatures such as my inverted twin or my zombie twin, then, the conceivability argument runs, this supports the metaphysical possibility of such creatures. And most agree that if such creatures are metaphysically possible, then phenomenal consciousness is neither physical nor functional: physicalism is false.

Yet another related argument is the explanatory argument. This argument begins with the premise that physicalist accounts explain only structure (such as spatiotemporal structure) and function (such as causal role). Then it is argued that explaining structure and function does not suffice to explain consciousness, and so physicalist accounts are explanatorily inadequate.

As Chalmers (2003) notes, the knowledge argument, the conceivability argument, and the explanatory argument can be seen as instances of a general, three-step argument. The first step is to establish an epistemic gap between the physical and phenomenal domains. In the case of the knowledge argument, the gap is often put in terms of a priori deducibility: there are phenomenal truths that cannot be a priori deduced from physical truths. In the case of the conceivability argument, the gap is put in terms of conceivability: it is conceivable that there be inverted qualia or zombies. And in the case of the explanatory argument, the point is put in terms of an explanatory gap. After establishing an epistemic gap, these arguments take a second step and infer a corresponding metaphysical gap: a gap in the world, not just in our epistemic relation to it. The knowledge argument infers a difference in type of fact. The conceivability argument infers the metaphysical possibility of inverted qualia or zombies. And the explanatory argument infers that there are phenomena that cannot be physically explained. As a third step, all three results appear to conflict with physicalism. There are important differences among the arguments, and it is not obvious that they stand or fall together. Nevertheless, it is worth noting that they follow a single abstract pattern.

4. More Physicalist Responses

Most physicalist responses to the knowledge argument fall into three categories: those that reject the inference to physicalism’s falsity and thus deny the metaphysical gap; those that reject the knowledge intuition and thus deny the epistemic gap; and those that derive an absurdity from Jackson’s reasoning.

We have already noted one way of rejecting the inference from the knowledge intuition to physicalism’s falsity: one could defend a version of physicalism on which the psychophysical conditional is necessary but not a priori. There are other ways of rejecting the inference. One is to reject the assumption that phenomenal knowledge is propositional knowledge—knowledge of truths or information. That is, one could argue that the type of knowledge Mary gains when she leaves the room is non propositional. The most popular version of this view is based on the ability hypothesis, the claim that to know what it’s like is to possess certain abilities, such as the ability to imagine, recognize, and remember experiences. On this view, Mary’s learning consists in her acquiring abilities rather than learning truths. As the view is sometimes put, she gains know-how, not knowledge-that. There are other versions, including the view that upon leaving the room Mary acquires only non propositional acquaintance knowledge (Conee 1994, Bigelow and Pargetter 1990). On this version, her learning consists, not in acquiring information or abilities, but in becoming directly acquainted with the phenomenal character of color experiences, in the way that one can become acquainted with a city by visiting it.

These views allow the physicalist to accept the knowledge intuition without facing objections that Jackson, Chalmers, and others bring against a posteriori physicalism. But other problems arise. Regarding the ability hypothesis, some doubt that Mary’s learning could consist only in acquiring abilities. Her new knowledge appears to have characteristic marks of propositional knowledge because its content can be embedded in conditionals such as “if seeing red is like this, then it is not like that” (Loar 1990/97). And some philosophers question the significance of the distinction between know-how and knowledge-that on which the strategy of the ability-hypothesis seems to rely (Alter 2001, Stanley and Williamson 2001).

The idea that Mary acquires only acquaintance knowledge has similar difficulties. It is not clear that all she acquires is acquaintance knowledge or that the requisite distinction between acquaintance knowledge and propositional knowledge is tenable. Also, there is a danger of trading on an ambiguity: sometimes “acquaintance” refers to knowledge, sometimes to experience. On the former, epistemic interpretation, it is unclear that Mary’s new “acquaintance knowledge” includes no factual component. And on the latter, experiential interpretation, the acquaintance hypothesis trivializes the learning claim: no one denies that when Mary leaves the room she has new experiences.

Another way to reject the inference to physicalism’s falsity is to argue that Mary’s learning consists in acquiring new ways to represent facts she knew before leaving the room (Loar 1990, 1997, Lycan 1996, Horgan 1984, McMullen 1985, Pereboom 1994, Tye 2002). This view is often combined with an appeal to a posteriori necessity (see section 2 above). But it need not be: one could argue that while the psychophysical conditional is a priori knowable by those who possess the relevant phenomenal concepts, Mary lacks those concepts before leaving the room. The main challenge for this view concerns the status of her new concepts. It is not enough to say that she gains some new concept or other: her conceptual gain must explain her gain in knowledge. The concern is that any concepts adequate to the task—such as the concept having an experience with phenomenal feel f—might incorporate a non physical component (Chalmers 2006b).

Philosophers have also devised ways to reject the knowledge intuition. Some believe that intuitions based on hypothetical cases should be given little or no weight. Also, specific strategies for rejecting the knowledge intuition have been developed. One is to reject the learning claim: to argue that on reflection Mary does not learn anything when she leaves the room. Some defend this position by arguing that we simply underestimate the power of complete physical knowledge. Suppose we try to fool Mary by greeting her when she leaves the room with a blue banana. Would she be fooled into thinking that seeing yellow is what we would describe as seeing blue? Not necessarily. She could use a brain scanner (perhaps a descendent of a PET device) to examine her own brain processes. She would notice that her brain processes correspond to people having blue experiences, and thereby evade our trap. Maybe our intuition that she learns something fails to take this sort of consideration into account (Dennett 1981, 2006). But other philosophers doubt that the intuition derives from any such error.

Another way to reject the knowledge intuition is to challenge the complete-knowledge claim: to argue that not all physical facts about seeing colors can be learned by watching black-and-white lectures. On this view, a fact might be physical but not discursively learnable. How could this be?

Some (for example, Horgan, 1984) use “physical” broadly, so that that the physical truths include high-level truths necessitated by the microphysical truths. These physicalists argue that phenomenal truths are themselves high-level physical truths, and that it is question-begging to assume that Mary knows all the physical truths simply because she watches lectures on chemistry, physics, etc. Chalmers (2004, 2006a) suggests a natural response to this move: use “physical” narrowly, so that the physical truths include only the microphysical truths (or those plus the truths in chemistry or some other specified domains). It is harder to deny that such truths would be accessible to the pre-release Mary. Of course, this entails that high-level biological truths, for example, will count as non physical, and thus the existence of non physical truths will not itself defeat physicalism. But if Jackson’s reasoning is sound, then there are phenomenal truths that are not metaphysically necessitated by the narrowly physical truths—and that result would defeat physicalism.

On another version of the view that the complete-knowledge claim is false, Mary’s science lectures allow her to deduce the truths involving structural-dynamical properties of physical phenomena, but not their intrinsic properties. The knowledge argument does not appear to refute this view. If this view can reasonably be called a physicalist view, then there is at least one version of physicalism that the knowledge argument appears to leave unchallenged. However, it is unclear that this is a significant deficiency. Arguably, on the view in question, consciousness (or protoconsciousness) is a fundamental feature of the universe—or at least no less fundamental than the properties describable in the language of physics, chemistry, etc. That sounds like the sort of view the knowledge argument should be used to establish, not refute. (It is a form of neutral monism; see next section.)

5. Non Physicalist Responses

If we accept the knowledge argument, then how should we understand the relationship between consciousness and the physical world? Jackson (1982) defends epiphenomenalism, on which phenomenal properties or qualia are caused by but do not cause physical phenomena. But epiphenomenalism is only one non physicalist view that the knowledge argument leaves open. Others include interactionism, parallelism, and idealism. These views agree that consciousness is not reducible to the physical, but disagree over how the two interact causally. On interactionist dualism, consciousness affects the physical world and vice versa. On parallelism, physical events and events of consciousness run in parallel but do not affect each other. On idealism, there are only conscious phenomena. The knowledge argument also leaves open neutral monism, the view that phenomenal properties (or protophenomenal properties) are the categorical, intrinsic bases of physical properties, which are at bottom dispositional and relational. This view might or might not be considered a version of physicalism, depending on whether the intrinsic nature of physical properties is considered physical.

All of these views have significant costs and benefits. For example, interactionist dualism is commonsensical but hard to reconcile with the popular view that the physical world is causally closed, that is, the view that every physical event has a sufficient physical cause. To take another example: epiphenomenalism preserves causal closure but seems to conflict with the widespread naturalistic assumption that consciousness is an integrated part of the natural world. Accepting the knowledge argument forces philosophers to weigh such costs and benefits and develop new, non physicalist accounts.

Historically, epiphenomenalism is associated with Huxley (1874), interactionist dualism with Descartes (1641), parallelism with Leibniz (1714), idealism with Berkeley (1713), and neutral monism with Russell (1927). For more recent versions, see Jackson (1982) and Robinson (1982b, 1988) for epiphenomenalism; see Popper and Eccles (1977), Hart (1988), Foster (1991), and Hodgson (1991) for interactionist dualism, see Rosenberg (2004) for neutral monism; and see Adams (forthcoming) for idealism. There are no recent defenses of parallelism.

6. Other Responses

Some claim that Jackson’s position is internally inconsistent (Watkins 1989, Campbell 2003). The argument runs roughly as follows. On the knowledge argument, Mary acquires knowledge when she leaves the room because she has states with new qualia. But this is impossible if, as Jackson (1982) suggests, epiphenomenalism is true: on epiphenomenalism, qualia are causally inefficacious; so, how can qualia produce an increase in knowledge? So, Jackson cannot consistently maintain both epiphenomenalism and the learning claim.

However, the sort of epiphenomenalism Jackson defends implies, not that phenomenal features are inefficacious, but only that they have no effects on physical phenomena. He might therefore reply that phenomenal knowledge is not a physical phenomenon, and thus qualia may indeed cause Mary to acquire it. Also, he can reasonably complain that the objection assumes a causal theory of knowledge that is not appropriate for phenomenal knowledge.

Despite the availability of these replies, there is a serious problem in the vicinity of the inconsistency objection. We should expect physical or functional explanations of our judgments about qualia. But if the knowledge argument is sound, then qualia would seem to be explanatorily irrelevant to these judgments—including the judgment that qualia cannot be explained in physical or functional terms. This is what David Chalmers calls “the paradox of phenomenal judgment” (Chalmers 1996, chapter 5). It appears to be a real problem, which arises for any non physicalist theory of consciousness.

Another important response to the knowledge argument should be noted. The argument seems to assume that “physical” has a clear meaning. But whether this notion can be adequately defined is not obvious. One problem is “Hempel’s dilemma” (Hempel 1980, Montero 1999). Arguably, we should not define the physical in terms of current physics, because current physics will be extended and presumably revised in substantial ways. We could define it in terms of ideal physics. But who knows what ideal physics will look like? Future physics may involve novel concepts that we cannot begin to imagine. If “physical” is defined in terms of such unknown concepts, then how can we judge whether Mary could learn all the physical facts from black-and-white lectures? And how else should we define the notion except by appeal to (current or ideal) physics?

Some take such considerations to show that the debate over whether consciousness is physical is misguided or meaningless (Chomsky 1980, 1988, Crane and Mellor 1990, Montero 1999). But the difficulty may be surmountable. On one view, ideal physics will not be wholly unrecognizable: like today’s physics, it will be concerned entirely with structure and dynamics. And one may be able to argue that any structural/dynamical properties can in principle be imparted by black-and-white lectures.

7. Jackson’s Retraction

As we noted earlier, Jackson (1998, 2003, 2006) has come to embrace physicalism and reject the knowledge argument. More specifically, he rejects the claim that Mary learns new truths when she leaves the room. He argues that this claim derives from a mistaken conception of sensory experience—a conception that he thinks should be replaced with representationalism, the view that phenomenal states are representational states. Interestingly, he combines this view with the ability hypothesis. He writes,

Those who resist accounts in terms of ability acquisition tend to say things like “Mary acquires a new piece of propositional knowledge, namely, that seeing red is like this”, but for the representationalist there is nothing suitable to be the referent of the demonstrative.

We have ended up agreeing with Laurence Nemirow and David Lewis [the authors of the ability-hypothesis strategy] on what happens to Mary on her release. But, for the life of me, I cannot see how we could have known they were right without going via representationalism. (Jackson 2003, p. 439)

It is unclear why Jackson’s representationalism leads him to embrace the ability hypothesis. Despite his commitments to physicalism and the apriority of the psychophysical conditional, he has other options. For example, instead of explaining Mary’s epistemic progress in terms of newly acquired abilities, he might argue that her “progress” is an illusion; in other words, he might reject the learning claim. Moreover, it may be possible to formulate a representationalist version of the knowledge argument that inherits the force of the original (Alter, 2006).

8. Summary of Assumptions and Criticisms

As we have seen, the knowledge argument depends on several controversial assumptions. It will be useful to summarize some of these assumptions and some criticisms of them. I will also mention some sources for relevant arguments.

Assumption 1: The coherence of the notion of the physical: physicalism is a substantive doctrine with non trivial content.

Criticism 1: The notion of the physical is not well defined, and there is no substantive issue of whether physicalism is true (Chomsky 1980, 1988, Crane and Mellor 1990, Montero 1999). For replies, see Chalmers (1996, 2004) and Stoljar (2000).

Assumption 2: The complete-knowledge claim (“truths” version): before leaving the room, Mary knows all physical truths.

Criticism 2a: Pre-release Mary does not know all the physical truths, because high-level physical truths cannot in general be a priori deduced from low-level physical truths (Horgan 1984, van Gulick 2004, Block and Stalnaker 1999). For replies, see Chalmers (2004, 2006a) and Chalmers and Jackson (2001).

Criticism 2b: Pre-release Mary does not know all the physical truths, because truths about the intrinsic properties of physical phenomena cannot be discursively learned (Alter 1998, Stoljar 2000). For replies, see Chalmers (1996, 2003, 2004, 2006a)

Assumption 3: The learning claim: upon leaving the room, Mary learns something.

Criticism 3a: We think Mary learns something because we fail to appreciate the implications of knowing all physical truths (Foss 1989, Stemmer 1989, Dennett 1991, 2004, 2006a). For replies, see Chalmers (1996), Alter (1998), Robinson (1993), and Jacquette (1995).

Criticism 3b: We think Mary learns something because we fail to recognize that phenomenal properties are just representational properties (Jackson 2003). For a reply, see Alter (2006); and for a counter-reply, see Jackson (2006).

Criticism 3c: Mary gains only unjustified beliefs (Beisecker 2000).

Assumption 4: The non-deducibility claim: if Mary learns new phenomenal truths when she leaves the room, then those truths cannot be a priori deduced from the complete physical truth.

Criticism 4: Mary cannot deduce certain phenomenal truths from the complete physical truth only because she lacks the relevant concepts, such as the concept of phenomenal redness. Thus, even though Mary cannot deduce Q from P, the psychophysical conditional is a priori for those who have the relevant concepts (Tye 2000, Hellie 2004). For replies, see Chalmers (2004, 2006a) and Stoljar (forthcoming).

Assumption 5: The propositional-knowledge claim: the kind of knowledge Mary gains upon leaving the room is propositional or factual—knowledge of information or truths.

Criticism 5a: Mary gains only abilities (Lewis 1983, 1988, Nemirow 1990, Mellor 1993, Meyer 2001). For replies, see Jackson (1986), Bigelow and Pargetter (1990), Loar (1990/97), Conee (1994), Nida-Rümelin (1995), Lycan (1996), Alter (1998, 2001), Gertler (1999), Tye (2002, chapter 1), Raymont (1999), and Papineau (2002). For counter-replies, see Tye (2002, chapter 1) and Nemirow (2006).

Criticism 5b: Mary gains only acquaintance knowledge (Conee 1994, Bigelow and Pargetter 1990). For replies, see Alter (1998), Gertler (1999), and Papineau (2002).

Criticism 5c: Mary gains non propositional knowledge that does not fit easily into folk categories (Churchland 1985, 1989).

Assumption 6: The new-information claim: the information Mary gains upon leaving the room is genuinely new to her.

Criticism 6: Mary merely comes to know truths she already knew under new, phenomenal representations. This view is sometimes called the old-fact/new-representation view. It comes in at least two versions. On one, phenomenal knowledge is assimilated to indexical knowledge: Mary’s “learning” is comparable to the absent-minded U.S. historian’s learning that today is July 4th, America's Independence Day (McMullen 1985). For replies, see Chalmers (1996, 2004, 2006a). Another version attaches the old-fact/new-representation view to a posteriori physicalism. Advocates of this version include Loar (1990/97), Lycan (1996), Horgan (1984), and Pereboom (1994). For replies, see Alter (1995, 1998) Chalmers (1996, 2003, 2004, 2006a) and Stoljar (2000).

Assumption 7: The claim that the knowledge intuition entails non necessitation: if there are phenomenal truths that cannot be a priori deduced from the complete physical truth, then the complete physical truth does not metaphysically necessitate those phenomenal truths.

Criticism 7: Physicalism is an a posteriori necessity and is therefore compatible with the claim that the phenomenal truths are not deducible from the complete physical truth. For references, see the second version of criticism 6 above.

Assumption 8: The consistency claim: the knowledge argument and non physicalism are consistent.

Criticism 8: The assumption that Mary gains knowledge is inconsistent with epiphenomenalism (Watkins 1989, Campbell 2003). For replies, see Nagasawa (n.d.).

The knowledge argument rests on other assumptions. One is that if Mary gains new, non physical information, then there are non physical properties. Another is that if there are truths that are not metaphysically necessitated by the complete physical truth, then physicalism is false. But doubts about these assumptions may be terminological variants on doubts about assumptions 1-8.

Some critics combine elements of different criticisms. For example, Michael Pelczar’s (forthcoming) criticism appears to contain elements of the acquaintance hypothesis and the old-fact/new-representation view; Jackson both rejects the learning claim and endorses the ability hypothesis (Jackson 2003); and Robert van Gulick (2004) argues that the various physicalist criticisms of the knowledge argument can be seen as parts of a single, coherent reply. Those who endorse the knowledge argument (in addition to Jackson, before he changed his mind) include Robinson (1982a), Nida-Rümelin (1995), Chalmers (1996, 2004, 2006a), and Gertler (1999).

William Lycan (2003) writes, “Someday there will be no more articles written about the “Knowledge Argument”… That is beyond dispute. What is less certain is, how much sooner that day will come than the heat death of the universe” (Lycan 2003). At least for now, however, the knowledge argument continues to inspire fruitful reflection on the nature of consciousness and its relation to the natural world.

9. References and Further Reading

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  • Alter, Torin. 2001. “Know-How, Ability, and the Ability Hypothesis”, Theoria, 67, 229-39.
  • Alter, Torin. 2006. “Does Representationalism Undermine the Knowledge Argument?” Forthcoming in T. Alter and S. Walter (Eds.) Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Beisecker, David. 2000. “There's Something about Mary: Phenomenal Consciousness and Its Attributions”, Southwest Philosophy Review, 16, 143-52.
  • Berkeley, George. 1713. Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous.
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  • Brainspotting. 1994. U.K. television series.
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  • Bigelow, John, and Robert Pargetter. 1990. “Acquaintance with Qualia”, Theoria, 61, 129-47.
  • Campbell, Neil 2003. “An Inconsistency in the Knowledge Argument”, Erkenntnis, 58, 261-66.
  • Chalmers, David J. 1996. The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, David J. 2002. “Consciousness and it Place in Nature” in S. Stich and T. Warfield (eds.), The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Mind, Oxford: Blackwell. Reprinted in D. Chalmers (ed.), The Philosophy of Mind: Classical and Contemporary Readings, (2002): 247–272, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, David J. 2004. “Phenomenal Concepts and the Knowledge Argument.” In Ludlow, et. al. (2004).
  • Chalmers, David J. 2006a. “The Two-Dimensional Argument against Materialism.” Forthcoming in his The Character of Consciousness. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, David J. 2006b. “Phenomenal Concepts and the Explanatory Gap”. Forthcoming in T. Alter and S. Walter Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Chalmers, D.J. and Jackson, F. (2001). Conceptual Analysis and Reductive Explanation. Philosophical Review 110: 315-61.
  • Chomsky, Noam. 1980. Rules and Representations, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Chomsky, Noam. 1988. Language and Problems of Knowledge: The Managua Lectures, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Churchland, Paul. 1985. “Reduction, Qualia, and the Direct Introspection of Brain States”, Journal of Philosophy, 82, 8-28.
  • Churchland, Paul. 1989. “Knowing Qualia: A Reply to Jackson”, in A Neurocomputational Perspective, Cambridge: MIT Press, 67-76.
  • Conee, Earl. 1994. “Phenomenal Knowledge”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 72, 136-50.
  • Crane, Tim and Hugh Mellor 1990. “There is no question of physicalism”, Mind, 99, 185-206.
  • Dennett, Daniel C. 1991. Consciousness Explained, Boston: Little Brown and Company.
  • Dennett Daniel C. 2005. Sweet Dreams: Philosophical Obstacles to a Science of Consciousness. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Dennett, Daniel C. 2006. “What RoboMary Knows”. Forthcoming in T. Alter and S. Walter (Eds) Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Descartes, René. Meditations on First Philosophy. 1641.
  • Foster, J. 1991. The Immaterial Self: A Defense of the Cartesian Dualist Conception of Mind. Routledge.
  • Foss, Jeff. 1989. “On the Logic of What It Is Like to be a Conscious Subject”, Australasian Journal of Philosophy 67, pp. 305-20.
  • Gertler, Brie 1999. “A Defense of the Knowledge Argument”, Philosophical Studies, 93, 317-36.
  • Hart, W. D. 1988. Engines of the Soul. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hellie, Benj 2004. “Inexpressible Truths and the Allure of the Knowledge Argument.” In Ludlow, et. al. (2004), 333-64.
  • Hempel, Carl. 1980. “Comments on Goodman's Ways of Worldmaking”, Synthese 45:193-9.
  • Hodgson, D. 1991. The Mind Matters: Consciousness and Choice in a Quantum World. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Horgan, Terence 1984. “Jackson on Physical Information and Qualia”, Philosophical Quarterly, 34, 147-52.
  • Huxley, Thomas H. 1874. “On the Hypothesis that Animals are Automata, and its History”. In D. Chalmers (ed.) The Philosophy of Mind. New York: Oxford University Press, 2002, 24-30.
  • Jackson, Frank. 1982. “Epiphenomenal Qualia”, Philosophical Quarterly, 32, 127-36.
  • Jackson, Frank. 1986. “What Mary Didn't Know”, Journal of Philosophy, 83, 291-5.
  • Jackson, Frank. 1995. “Postscript”, in Contemporary Materialism, ed. by Paul K. Moser and J. D. Trout, New York: Routledge, 184-9.
  • Jackson, Frank. 1998. “Postscript on Qualia.” In his Mind, Method, and Conditionals: Selected Essays: 76-79. London: Routledge.
  • Jackson, Frank. 2003. “Mind and Illusion”, in Minds and Persons: Royal Institute of Philosophy Supplement 53, ed. by Anthony O'Hear, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 251-271.
  • Jacquette, Dale. 1995. “The Blue Banana Trick: Dennett on Jackson's Color Scientist,” Theoria 61, pp. 217-30.
  • Kripke, Saul. 1972. “Naming and Necessity”. In The Semantics of Natural Language. Ed. G. Harman and D. Davidson. Dordrecht: Reidel. Reprinted as Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1980.
  • Leibniz, G. 1714. The Monadology.
  • Lewis, David. 1983. “Postscript to ‘Mad Pain and Martian Pain.’” In his Philosophical Papers, vol. 1. New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 130-32.
  • Lewis, David. 1988. “What Experience Teaches”, Proceedings of Russellian Society (University of Sydney), Reprinted in Lycan (1999); Block, Flanagan and Güzeldere (1997)
  • Loar, Brian. 1990. “Phenomenal States”, in Philosophical Perspectives IV: Action Theory and the Philosophy of Mind, ed. by James Tomberlin, Atascadero: Ridgeview Publishing, 81-108.
  • Loar, Brian. 1997. “Phenomenal States (Revised Version)”, in The Nature of Consciousness, ed. by Ned Block, Flanagan Owen and Güzeldere Güven, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 597-616.
  • Locke, John. 1690. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding.
  • Lodge, David. 2001. Thinks... London: Secker and Warburg Random House.
  • Ludlow, P., Y. Stoljar, and D. Nagasawa, eds. (2004) There’s Something about Mary: Essays on Phenomenal Consciousness and Frank Jackson’s Knowledge Argument. Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Lycan, William G. 1996. Consciousness and Experiences, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Lycan, William G. “Perspectival Representation and the Knowledge Argument,” in Q. Smith and A. Jokic (eds.), Consciousness: New Philosophical Essays (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003).
  • McMullen, C. (1985), “'Knowing What It's Like' and the Essential Indexical”, Philosophical Studies 48, pp. 211-33.
  • Mellor, D. H. 1993. “Nothing Like Experience.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 93, pp. 1-16.
  • Meyer, Uwe. 2001. “The Knowledge Argument, Abilities, and Metalinguistic Beliefs”, Erkenntnis, 55, 325-47.
  • Montero, Barbara. 1999. “The Body Problem,” Noûs, Vol. 33, No. 3 (1999) p. 183-20.
  • Nagasawa, Yujin, n.d. The “Most Powerful Reply” to the Knowledge Argument. ANU manuscript.
  • Nagel, Thomas. 1974. “What Is it Like to Be a Bat?”, Philosophical Review, 83, 435-50.
  • Nemirow, Lawrence. 1990. “Physicalism and the Cognitive Role of Acquaintance”, in Mind and Cognition: A Reader, ed. by William G. Lycan, Oxford: Blackwell, 490-9.
  • Nemirow, Lawrence. 2006. “So This is What it’s Like: a Defense of the Ability Hypothesis.” Forthcoming in T. Alter and S. Walter (eds) Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Nida-Rümelin, Martine 1995. “What Mary Couldn't Know: Belief About Phenomenal States”, in Conscious Experience, ed. by Thomas Metzinger, Exeter: Imprint Academic, 219-41.
  • Papineau, David. 2002. Thinking about Consciousness. New York: Oxford University Press, 2002.
  • Pelczar, Michael. “Enlightening the Fully Informed.” Forthcoming in Philosophical Studies.
  • Pereboom, Derk 1994. “Bats, Brain Scientists, and the Limitations of Introspection”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 54, 315-29.
  • Popper, K. and Eccles, J. 1977. The Self and its Brain: An Argument for Interactionism. Springer.
  • Raymont, Paul. 1999. “The Know-How response to Jackson's Knowledge Argument”, Journal of Philosophical Research, 24, 113-26.
  • Robinson, Howard. 1982a. Matter and Sense. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Robinson, Howard. 1993. “Dennett on the Knowledge Argument”, Analysis, 53, 174-7.
  • Robinson, W. S. (1982b) “Causation, Sensations and Knowledge”, Mind 91, 524-40.
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  • Stoljar, Daniel 2000. forthcoming. “Physicalism and Phenomenal Concepts”, forthcoming in Mind and Language.
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Author Information

Torin Alter
The University of Alabama
U. S. A.



Events are particular happenings, occurrences or changes, such as Rob's drinking the strong espresso at noon, the 1864 re-election of Abraham Lincoln in the US, and so on. At least at first blush, events all seem to have something in common, metaphysically speaking, and some philosophers have inquired into what this common nature is. The main aim of a theory of events is to propose and defend an identity condition on events; that is, a condition under which two events are identical. For example, if Brutus kills Caesar by stabbing him, are there two events, the stabbing and the killing, or only one event? Each of the leading theories of events is surveyed in this article. According to Jaegwon Kim, events are basically property instantiations. In contrast, Donald Davidson attempts to individuate events by their causes and effects. However, Davidson eventually rejects this view and, together with W.V.O. Quine, individuates events with respect to their location in spacetime. According to David Lewis, an event is a property of a spatiotemporal region. The selection of a theory of events is not a matter which one decides independently of one’s other metaphysical interests and commitments. The present discusses the relative strengths and weaknesses of several theories of events which can help to guide the reader’s own selection of a theory of events. Further philosophical developments may yield a theory of events which is more attractive than the approaches discussed here.

Table of Contents

  1. Kim's Property-Exemplification Account of Events
    1. Constitutive Object or Region
    2. Properties
    3. Excessive Fine-Grainedness
      1. The Official Line
      2. The Fallback Position
    4. Is the Constitutive Object (Time, Property) Essential?
  2. Davidson’s Theories of Events
    1. The Causal Criterion
    2. The Spatiotemporal Criterion
    3. Events or Objects?
    4. Davidson and Ontological Commitment to Events
  3. David Lewis’s Theory of Events
    1. Preliminaries
    2. The Details of Lewis' Theory
      1. A Non-Duplication Principle
      2. Regions
      3. Event Essences
      4. Fine-Grainedness and Logical Relations Between Events
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Kim's Property-Exemplification Account of Events

Events, according to Kim, are structured: they are constituted by an object (or number of objects), a property or relation, and a time (or an interval of time). For simplicity, the discussion will be restricted to monadic events, that is, events with a monadic property exemplified by a single object at a time. Kim's theory of events consists of two basic principles, the first states the conditions under which any given event exists, the second gives the conditions under which events are identical. In stating the principles Kim represents events by expressions of the form

[x, P, t]

where the operator "[. . .]" is intended to be a special case of the description operator, read "the unique event, x's having P at t." Kim's two principles are the following:

Existence Condition: [x, P, t] exists iff object x exemplifies the n-adic property P at time t.

That is, the unique event of object x’s having property P at time t exists if and only if the object x has P at a given time.

The second principle is the following:

Identity Condition: [x, P,t] = [y,Q, t'] iff x = y, P = Q, and t = t'.

This principle reads: the unique event, x’s having P at a given time t, is identical to the unique event, y’s having Q at a given time t’, if and only if x is identical to y, P is identical to Q, and t is identical to t’. It is sometimes also called the “non-duplication principle.”

According to Kim, (i) events are non-repeatable, concrete particulars, including not only changes but also states and conditions. (ii) Each event has a spatiotemporal location. (iii) Although events may exemplify any number of properties, only one property, the constitutive property, individuates the event. The constitutive properties are not exemplified by the event, but are exemplified by the constitutive substance:

Events themselves have (exemplify) properties; Brutus' stabbing Caesar has the property of occurring in Rome, it was intentional, it led to the death of Caesar and caused grief in Calpurnia, and so on.... The properties an event exemplifies must be sharply distinguished from its constitutive property (which is exemplified, not by an event, but by the constitutive substance of the event)…. (Kim, 1993, p. 170).

With this in mind we might call attention to the difference between an event's exemplifying a property from an event's being an exemplification of a property. According to Kim the event is an exemplification of only the constitutive property while the event exemplifies any number of non-constitutive properties. (iv) Kim gets a type-token relation for events by regarding the constitutive property as the generic event. Particular exemplifications of the constitutive property by a constitutive object are tokens of the generic event. (v) Kimean events are not just ordered triples of the form . Consider the event of Oedipus' marrying Jocasta at t. A triple exists when Oedipus,t, and marrying Jocasta exist. But the triple can exist while the event does not, namely, Oedipus may fail to have the property, marrying Jocasta, at t.

What follows are the main criticisms of Kim’s theory of events.

a. Constitutive Object or Region

Myles Brand criticizes the account for not being able to accommodate the intuition many have that an event might not have a constitutive object: "Leaving aside the controversial case of mental events, there are changing weather conditions, changing light conditions, changing fields, and so on." (Brand, 1997, 335) Brand suggests that Kim modify his account by taking spatiotemporal regions as the constituents of events, rather saying that objects are the constituents. So, if an event involves a flash of lightning or a magnetic field increasing in strength, the event occupies (at minimum) the space in which the flash or field increase occurs. It is certainly open to Kim to modify his theory accordingly.

b. Properties

Since, on Kim's view, events are property exemplifications, a natural question to ask is: what sorts of properties are acceptable as constitutive properties (and thereby as event types)? Kim provides little specification of what sort of view of properties the theory is to be wedded to. Indeed, Kim's discussion of events does not even specify whether such properties are universals, tropes (as non-repeatables), natural classes, or something else. (Readers unfamiliar with the different views on the nature of properties should see Oliver, 1996). And we might ask whether the properties are sparse (such as Armstrong's theory of universals) or abundant, corresponding to every predicate (or nearly every predicate). (Again, see Oliver, 1996). The following passage gives us a rough idea how Kim would answer this latter question:

. . . [T]he basic generic events may be best picked out relative to a scientific theory, whether the theory is a common-sense theory of the behavior of middle-sized objects or a highly sophisticated physical theory. They are among the important properties, relative to the theory, in terms of which lawful regularities can be discovered, described, and explained. The basic parameters in terms of which the laws of the theory are formulated would, on this view, give us our basic generic events, and the usual logical, mathematical, and perhaps other types of operations on them would yield complex, defined generic events. We commonly recognize such properties as motion, colors, temperatures, weights, pushing, and breaking, as generic events and states, but we must view this against the background of our common-sense explanatory and predictive scheme of the world around us. I think it highly likely that we cannot pick out generic events completely a priori. (Kim,1993, p.37)

So Kim would like a theory of events which provides a framework to develop theories of causation, explanation, and to explore the mind-body problem and the relation between micro and macro events more generally (Kim,1993, p.36). Such desiderata seem reasonable and, at least at first blush, Kim's rough gesturing at a notion of properties seems suitable to such desiderata.

This passage also tells us that Kim is open to the view that an answer to the question, “What properties are there?” might involve an a posteriori element, left to scientific theory. But there are further issues that a proponent of the exemplification theory should eventually address. For instance, which properties can be constitutive of events? (i) If the account of properties selected allows that (purported) properties like being equal to the square root of two are in fact properties, such properties do not seem to be properties that can constitute events. (Brand, 1997, p. 335) (ii) If walking is a property constitutive of events, is walking slowly? (We will turn to ii. shortly).

Myles Brand has criticized the property exemplification view because it lacks a criterion for property identity. (Brand, 1997, p. 335) The problem is that Kim's account is incomplete because we cannot determine when events are identical. We cannot do this because we do not know when they have the same properties. This objection may strike one as weak because it seems to require too much of the property exemplification account. As Brand notes ". . . solutions to a number of central philosophical problems -- for instance the mind-body problem, scientific theory reduction and meaning change -- also require identity conditions for properties." (Brand, 1997, p.335) It seems excessive to require Kim to solve such problems to give a viable theory of events. We now turn to more serious criticisms of the theory.

c. Excessive Fine-Grainedness

Although Kim's above passage gives us a better idea of what sorts of properties constitute events, it does not answer the following question: if "F" is a predicate or verb designating some generic event, (e.g., walking), and "M" is a predicate modifier, (e.g., slowly) does "M(F)" name a new generic event (walking slowly), or does the modifier indicate that the generic event (the walk) exemplifies the property (being slow)? If Sebastian strolls leisurely through the streets of Bologna at t is the stroll the same event as the leisurely stroll? Most people's intuition is that they are the same event. Let's call the need for a satisfactory answer to this question “The Problem of Predicate Modification.”

Indeed, the most serious criticism of Kim’s theory is that it yields events that are too fine-grained. That is, events are regarded as being distinct that, intuitively, are the same event. There are two basic types of prolificacy that worry critics. (i) First, there is the Problem of Predicate Modification. (ii) Second, there are sorts of prolificacy not arising from the M(F) operation but from the question: if S does x by doing y is S's doing x the same event as S's doing y? Let’s begin with a discussion of type (ii) cases.

Type (ii) prolificacy. To employ a well-known example, on Kim's view the stabbing of Caesar is a different event from the killing of Caesar, because the properties of being a stabbing and being a killing are, by any reasonable account of property individuation, distinct. (Bennett, 1991) The criticism begins by noting that it is a historical fact that the method of killing was a stabbing. The critic interprets this as saying that the properties were co-instantiated. To this the critic adds that co-instantiation is sufficient for property identity, although, not, of course, sufficient for event identity. Kim's account of events turns events into property tokens, getting the nature of events wrong. (Bennett, 1991)

Jonathan Bennett provides a detailed objection along such lines, but adding an additional, informative element to his claim that Kimean events are too fine-grained. First, his general claim:

Kim maintains that two nominals can pick out a single event only if (roughly speaking) their predicative parts are equivalent: so it cannot be true that the kick he gave her was the assault he made on her. I argue against this, contending that most of Kim's prima facie evidence for it depends on his running events together with facts. It is beyond dispute that his kicking her is not the same as his assaulting her, these being different facts. (Bennett,1991, p.626)

His contention that Kim conflates events and facts is fueled by an informative distinction between imperfect and perfect nominals, which he links to a distinction between fact language and event language, respectively:

Following Vendler, I take it that these [event names] will be perfect and not imperfect nominals. Quisling's betrayal of Norway (perfect) was an event; Quisling's betraying Norway (imperfect) is a fact, namely the fact that Quisling betrayed Norway. Quisling's betraying Norway is different from his doing Norway a disservice; these are two facts. His betrayal of Norway was his disservice to Norway; there was only the one event. (Bennett,1991, p. 625)

Perfect nominals, according to Vendler's research, are our main device for event talk, passing all of the tests for being an event sortal. (Bennett, 1998, p. 6) (However, it should be noted that not all perfect nominals name events. For discussion of this see Bennett, 1988, p. 7). In contrast, imperfect nominals never refer to events because they ". . . don't behave syntactically as though they were applicable to located particulars: they don't take articles or attributive adjective, they don't have plural forms, and so on. Their semantic behavior is wrong too: they don't go comfortably into contexts about being observed, occurring at stated times or lasting for stated periods, and so on." (Bennett, 1988, p.7) Instead of naming events imperfect nominals name facts (that is, states of affairs that obtain) and more generally, states of affairs. Vendler and Bennett provide the following argument to the conclusion that imperfect nominals name facts. First, they claim that there is a sort of imperfect nominal that contains a complete sentence in it, sentence nominals, which function as noun phrases which pass all the tests for being imperfect nominals. Bennett takes it that such constructions name facts. He calls these “that [S] constructions.” Bennett further claims:

I contend that any sentence using an imperfect gerundial nominal is synonymous with one in which that gerundial nominals work is done instead by a "that [S] nominal. Test this, and if you find no counterexamples you will agree that imperfect gerundial nominals are basically interchangeable with "that [S] nominals and are therefore names of facts. If you do find counterexamples, Vendler and I must back off, saying merely that many gerundial imperfect nominals name facts and that none name events, and it will be a further problem to know what marks of the fact names from the rest. But I shall stay with the stronger claim until it is refuted. (Bennett, 1988, p.8)

Bennett applies his claim that perfect nominals are our main device for referring to event kinds while imperfect nominals always refer to facts to help settle the dispute concerning type (ii) prolificacy cases. Bennett illustrates how the distinction is useful with respect to this issue by calling our attention to the following interchange between Kim and Davidson:

It is not at all absurd to say that Brutus' killing Caesar is not the same as Brutus' stabbing Caesar. Further, to explain Brutus' killing Caesar (why Brutus killed Caesar) is not the same as to explain Brutus' stabbing Caesar (why Brutus stabbed Caesar). (Kim, 1993, p 232)

Davidson remarks:

I turn. . . to Kim's remark that it is not absurd to say that Brutus' killing Caesar is not the same as Brutus' stabbing Caesar. The plausibility of this is due, I think, to the undisputed fact that not all stabbings are killings. . . . But [this does not show] that this particular stabbing was not a killing. Brutus' stabbing of Caesar did result in Caesar's death so it was in fact, though not of course necessarily, identical with Brutus' killing of Caesar. (Davidson, 1980, p. 171)

It does appear that, as Bennett aptly puts it, while Kim is saying true things about facts, Davidson is saying true things about events. The provisional conclusion that I draw on the criticism that Kimean events turn events into facts, getting the nature of events wrong, is the following: if one is impressed by the view that the stabbing of Caesar and the killing of Caesar are the same event then one must make sure that it is not because they find it plausible that Brutus' killing Caesar and Brutus' stabbing Caesar are distinct. For Bennett has given us reason to believe that such plausibility derives from the plausible distinctness of facts. (Further, Kim has not disputed Bennett’s distinction or its application to the type (ii) prolificacy dispute). On the other hand, perhaps a proponent of the property-exemplification view would like to dispute the linguistic data, or, instead, claim that while the data capture our ordinary event concept, a philosophical theory of events should not seek to satisfy the ordinary event concept, but should instead engage in a conceptual revision.

Type (i) prolificacy. Although Kim is not interested in renouncing the prolificacy of type (ii) he believes that it is a more serious matter that his view might allow adverbial modification to give rise to distinct generic events, (e.g., Sebastian's strolling and Sebastian's strolling leisurely are distinct events). That is, he takes such cases as being more plausible examples of excessive fine-grainedness: "it is more plausible to deny identity in cases like it (the stabbing case) than in cases like Sebastian's stroll and Sebastian's leisurely stroll (where we suppose Sebastian did stroll leisurely)." (Kim,1993, p. 44) Kim does not say why the stabbing case is more plausible case of distinct events; but he is certainly in tandem with most people's intuitions in this regard. He offers two ways to deal with the Problem of Adverbial Modification, advancing one as "the official line" and the other as a fallback position.

i. The Official Line

Kim's strategy is to regard the events as being different, but not entirely distinct events, by claiming that leisurely stroll includes the stroll. Kim does not explain the sort of inclusion that he is appealing to. It is certainly a different sort than a type of inclusion that we might normally apply to events: for example, we might conceive of a war as an extended event consisting of a number of battles, a buying a book as a standing at the register and handing the money and so forth. In each of these cases the extended event has the events of shorter duration as temporal parts. We might say that Sebastian's stroll is like these by stipulating that there was a temporal part of the stroll that was not leisurely -- say he leapt over a puddle. But this would be missing the point as one could just specify a different case such that an entire stroll was leisurely. Kim offers the following point to motivate the non-standard sort of event inclusion that he has in mind:

Take this table: the top of the table is not the same thing as the table. So there are two things, but of course one table -- in fact, there are lots of things here if you include the legs, the molecules, the atoms, etc., making up the table. (Kim,1993, p. 46)

One can construct individuals, as counterintuitive to the layperson they may be, from the mereological sum of any spatio-temporal parts. But given a particular table, it would be quite odd to claim that the mereological sum of all of its parts is a new individual, and not, instead, that very same individual. Since the stroll and the leisurely stroll occupy the same space-time worm, the analogy with physical objects will not go through: for a physical object x to include distinct physical object y it requires at least one proper part that is had by object x that is not had by object y and that x have all of y's parts as proper parts. There is no proper part (time-space region) occupied by the stroll that is not also occupied by the leisurely stroll. We thus have motivation for turning to the second option that Kim provides for dealing with the Problem of Adverbial Modification.

ii. The Fallback Position

The remaining option is to deny that modifiers, or at least a certain class of them, give rise to new generic events, instead, they indicate properties of the generic events. (For example, strolling leisurely is not a generic event, but being leisurely is exemplified by Sebastian's stroll.) Kim views this option as bringing with it a major drawback: namely, it compromises his original motivation for supplying a theory of events in the first place -- that events be the sort of entities that enter into causal relations and are objects of explanations: "But it is clear that we may want to explain not only why Sebastian strolled, i.e., Sebastian's stroll, but also why he strolled leisurely, i.e., his leisurely stroll. Under the approach being considered, the second explanation would be of why Sebastian's stroll was leisurely; we would be explaining why a certain event had a certain property, not why a certain event occurred." (Kim,1993, p. 45)

d. Is the Constitutive Object (Time, Property) Essential?

A second major challenge to the property-exemplification view is the claim that it relies on dubious claims about the essential properties of events. Consider the constitutive object: could the very same event, the changing of the guard, have occurred if a guard was a different person? Could it have been the same event if, instead, it was slightly earlier? Both of these questions raise plausible possibilities.

Kim agrees that the time is not an essential feature of certain events : "it seems correct to say that the stroll could have occurred a little earlier or later than it actually did."(Kim,1993, p. 48) Kim is also sympathetic to the claim that the property is not essential, although his concern is limited to cases in which modifiers give rise to new generic events. (Kim,1993, p. 47) However, Kim rejects the view that the constitutive substance is not essential.

The fact that someone other than Sebastian could have taken a stroll in his place does not make it the case that the very stroll that Sebastian took could have been taken by someone else. If Mario had been chosen to stroll that night, then there would have been another stroll, namely Mario's. (Kim, 1993, p. 48)

One natural reaction is to disagree with this assessment because it seems plausible that in the changing of the guard case, the very same event, the changing of the guard, could have occurred if a guard was a different person. But perhaps it is better to not haggle intuitions; the real issue is how Kim, of all people, can be sympathetic to challenges to the non-essentiality of the constitutive time and property. Doesn't he have to deny this? The matter hinges on whether it is plausible, as Kim seems to believe, that the following claims be held in tandem:

(1) The constitutive time and (in cases of modification) the constitutive property are non-essential

(2) Both of the following are true:

Identity Condition: [x, P,t] = [y,Q, t'] iff x = y, P = Q, and t = t'.

Existence Condition: [x, P, t] exists (occurs) iff object x exemplifies the n-adic property P at time t.

Begin with the first condition. Identity Conditions do not need to entirely specify an entity's nature. As Kim notes: "It is at least a respectable identity criterion for physical objects that they are the same just in case they are completely coincident in space and time. From this it does not follow that a physically object is essentially where and when it in fact is." (Kim,1993, p.48) Now consider the Existence Condition. It tells us something about the modal character of events: events are necessarily exemplifications of properties by objects at times. Kim agrees: "There is an essentialist consequence I am willing to accept: events are, essentially, structured complexes of the sort the theory says they are. Thus, events could not be substances, properties, and so on." (Kim,1993, p.49) But it doesn't tell us about the modal character of the event in the following sense: it doesn't say whether the event can occur without any, or even all, of the constitutive entities. Hence, it doesn't tell us whether any of the constitutive entities are essential. From these observations once can conclude that the conjunction of (1) and (2) are consistent. Consistent, but informative? Although our brief discussion concludes with the observation that Kim avoids a serious criticism, the discussion has also raised the point that Kim has only given a partial specification of the nature of events. To fully specify the nature of events more needs to be said about the modal character of the constitutive entities. Here, intuition haggling comes into play. As Kim comments, on this score, "the general problem is still open." (Kim,1993, p.49)

2. Davidson’s Theories of Events

Kim defends a relatively fine grained theory of events, but Davidson types events in a rather coarse way. Davidson has advanced two conditions. Initially, he proposed the principle that no two events can have exactly the same causes and effects. Then, after discarding this principle, he proposed that no two events can occur in exactly the same space-time zone, a view which Quine also advanced. The following sections evaluate both non-duplication principles. The discussion of Davidson’s work on events concludes with some general remarks about his influential argument for the existence of events from the use of action sentences.

a. The Causal Criterion

In "The Individuation of Events," Davidson sets himself the task of determining a criterion for the sameness and difference of events, where events are understood as particular, non-repeatable occurrences. After considering and rejecting various proposals Davidson settles on the following:

(DT1) events are identical iff they have exactly the same causes and effects

Noting "an air of circularity" about this suggestion, he formulates (DT1) as the following:

(DT1') (Ax)(Ay)(Az)[x = y iff (z caused x iff z caused y) and (x caused z iff y caused z)]

He then writes: "No identities appear on the right of the biconditional." (Davidson, 1980, p.179) Well, this is true, but (DT') is nonetheless circular because, of course, x,y and z are events. The circularity is not excisable either, for the gist of Davidson's suggestion is that events can be individuated by their causes and effects, but what is a cause or effect, for Davidson, if not an event? Davidson claims (inter alia) that events e and e' are identical only if e and e' have all the same causes. But causes are events, and to determine if e and e' have the same causes we need to determine whether each of e's causes has all the same effects as some cause that e' has. And among these effects are e and e', the very events we are trying to distinguish or, alternately, identify. (Lombard, 1998)

Davidson later concedes that (DT1') is indeed circular and, in light of this, moves to a theory that he had previously rejected in his discussion of Lemmon's proposal at (Davidson, 1980, p.178).

b. The Spatiotemporal Criterion

Lemmon's proposal was:

(DT2) events are identical iff they occur in the same space at the same time

Davidson had previously rejected (DT2) because ". . . I thought one might want to hold that two different events used up the same portion of space-time. . ." (Davidson, 1985, p.175) Davidson's discussion of Lemmon's proposal will come back to haunt him. In particular, Davidson provided an intriguing example. This example, many believe, is decisive against DT2, the proposal that Davidson himself continued to favor.

Doubt comes easily in the case of events, for it seems natural to say that two different changes can come over the whole of a substance at the same time. For example, if a metal ball becomes warmer during a certain minute, and during the same minute rotates through 35 degrees, must we say that these are the same event? (Davidson, 1980, p.178)

There are two ways of interpreting the example which the discussions of this example sometimes fails to distinguish. Let us begin with one specification, which we will discard as not even superficially challenging the view that there can be different events in the same spacetime location.

(i) The rotation, although occurring during the same minute, temporally precedes the warming. This interpretation takes "at the same time" in the above passage as meaning, "during the same minute." This could happen if both events occur at, say, 2:51 and the rotating precedes the warming by, say, ten seconds. This seems to be Simone Evnine's interpretation of the case. (Evnine, 1991, p. 29) This reading of the problem is much easier to solve because the events would be (at least partly) spatiotemporally distinct. Evnine's interpretation was probably encouraged by the fact that rotating an object will cause the object to warm slightly, in such cases the rotating will precede the warming. It doesn’t seem useful to conceive of the example in this way because it is not, even at first blush, a potential counterexample to the sufficiency of spacetime location for sameness of event because the spacetime locations obviously differ, although they partly overlap.

(ii) It may be suggested that we forget that rotating causes slight warming, and suppose, for the sake of argument, that some additional warming of the object occurs at the same time as the object rotates. Although Davidson does not note this, we can fairly construe his puzzle as being about the additional warming and its having the same spatiotemporal location as the rotating. We have the strong intuition that the additional warming (hereafter "warming") and the rotating are different events; this is the interesting interpretation of the case because it raises a potential counterexample to (DT2).

Construed in this way, the matter is quite tricky. First, a general observation. When things warm up their molecules randomly jiggle about. This is a different sort of molecular motion than is involved in a thing's rotating. Given this observation, it might seem like (DT2) is not challenged by the example, after all. One might have the belief that, given this observation, there should be some way to prove that different, (but not completely distinct), spacetime regions are involved. It is natural to be skeptical that such a maneuver is available, however. The same molecules that are randomly jiggling about, because of the heating, are also revolving. Similarly, one cannot assign different spacetime regions to Joe’s Northeasterly walk, although it is, in a sense, both a Northerly walk and an Easterly walk. So this appears to be a counterexample to Davidson's proposal.

Now, assuming that one is a proponent of DT2, how should one respond to Davidson's own example of a top's spinning and heating up? The proponent could swallow the unintuitive result that the spinning and the heating are very same event, saying that DT2 is still in the running, as a non-duplication, principle, because other leading theories of events also have counterintuitive results in some cases. For recall that Kim holds that

(KT) [x,P,t] exists (occurs) iff object x exemplifies the n-adic property p at time t.

On this view the stabbing of Caesar is a different event from the killing of Caesar because the properties are distinct (according to any plausible property theory). This strikes many as being too fine-grained; the killing and the stabbing are not distinct events, although being a killing and being a stabbing are distinct properties. Selecting a theory of events involves an all-things considered judgment that weighs the various strengths and weaknesses of the competing theories. If other non-duplication principles have equally counterintuitive results, then, ceteris paribus, DT2 is still in the running.

c. Events or Objects?

Any critical evaluation of Davidson’s theory of events should (at least briefly) consider the other influential objection to DT2. A common view is that objects are identical if and only if they occupy the same space-time location. And this is precisely DT2, causing some to believe that it gets the nature of events wrong. The objector's intuition that events are not objects is grounded in the view that events are occurrences and objects are not. So, by Leibniz' Law, events and objects are distinct. For Davidson's position to be convincing he needs to explain away the strong intuition that events are occurrences and objects are not. Davidson is concerned with the conflation, and in light of it offers the following suggestion:

. . . events and objects may be related to locations in spacetime in different ways; it may be, for example, that events occur at a time in a place while objects occupy places at times.

Occupying the same portion of spacetime, event and object differ. One is an object which remains the same object through changes, the other a change in an object or objects. Spatiotemporal areas do not distinguish them, but our predicates, our basic grammar, our ways of sorting do. Given my interest in the metaphysics implicit in our language, this is a distinction I do not want to give up. (Davidson, 1980, pp.176)

It does seem correct that when we conceive of events, we generally think of changes, or occurrences. This feature seems to rest at the kernel of our event-concept.

Evnine's reaction to Davidson's claim is that "this attempt to resist the assimilation of events to objects will only work if we are able to make a convincing distinction between occurring and occupying which does not itself rely on the distinction between events and objects." (Evnine, 1991, p. 31) If Evnine is suggesting that an account of events would be circular should it fail to cash out the notion of occurring in a way that doesn't presuppose eventhood this is not an entirely decisive objection -- the concept of an occurrence could simply be taken as primitive in an analysis. However, some would find it unattractive that an unexplained notion, and one that seems so close to the concept of an event, that of an occurrence, is doing all the work in dividing objects from events.

The following, more decisive objection to Davidson's suggestion may occur to one: there is an intuitive distinction between occurring and occupying -- we see events unfold and objects occupy spaces -- but it is important to note that many, including Lewis and Kim, consider events, as a metaphysical category, to include some non-happenings or non-occurrence as well as all happenings. And Bennett notes that Davidson himself has "never said that events must be changes and . . . did once express tolerance for the idea of such movements as standing fast.'" (Bennett, 1988, p.176, quoting Davidson) Davidson's manner of distinguishing events from objects, in so far as it involves the claim that events are essentially occurrences, seems, at least at first blush, incompatible with the view that events are non-occurrences. If Davidson believes that some non-occurrences are events then, in order to preserve his original point, in addition to telling us more about his occurrence/occupation distinction he needs to answer the question: if non-occurrences can be events why are such non-occurrences not objects? Perhaps the only manner of preserving the idea that events are an ontological kind is by renouncing the view that some non-occurrences are events.

At this point it is not clear if Davidson would be interested in doing so. Here I can only gesture in the direction of a possible difficulty. In his chapter on adverbial modification, Bennett suggests that Davidson needs to consider unchanging events in order to

. . . smooth the way for applying his theory to many uses of adverbs to modify not verbs but adjectives. 'Marvin was icily silent' entails 'Marvin was silent' and it would be uncomfortable for a Davidsonian to have to exclude such entailments from the scope of his theory. It would be better for him to say that the former sentence had the form: For some x: x was an episode of silence, and Marvin was the subject of x, and x was icy. (Bennett, 1988, p.76)

It is likely that the Davidsonian would be interested in applying his theory to uses of adverbs that modify adjectives. This attractive feature will have to be balanced against any desire to distinguish events from objects.

d. Davidson and Ontological Commitment to Events

Finally, in our discussion thus far the existence of events has been taken for granted, the issue being how to individuate them. But Davidson's work on events is not limited to a defense of a non-duplication principle, indeed, he argues that we need to posit events (inter alia) to explain the meanings of statements employing adverbial modifiers. In "The Individuation of Events" he writes:

. . . without events it does not seem possible to give a natural and acceptable account of the logical form of certain sentences of the most common sorts; it does not seem possible, that is, to show how the meanings of such sentences depend upon their composition. The situation may be sketched as follows. it is clear that the sentence 'Sebastian strolled through the streets of Bologna at 2 a.m." entails "Sebastian strolled through the streets of Bologna", and does so by virtue of its logical form. This requires, it would seem, that the patent syntactical fact that the entailed sentence is contained in the entailing sentence be reflected in the logical form we assign to each sentence. Yet the usual way of formalizing these sentences does not show any such feature: it directs us to consider the first sentence as containing an irreducibly three-place predicate 'x strolled through y at t' while the second contains the unrelated predicate 'x strolled through y.' (Davidson, 1980, p.166-7)

Davidson suggests that we solve this puzzle by accepting the intuitive idea that "there are things like falls, devourings, and strolls for sentences such as these to be about." The sentence

Sebastian strolled though the streets of Bologna at 2 a.m.

has the following logical form:

There is an event x such that Sebastian strolled x, x took place in the streets of Bologna, and x was going on at 2 a.m.

This logical form yields the problematic entailments. Davidson's view is that this correct logical form for action sentences motivates the ontological commitment to events because quantification over a kind of entity involves an ontological commitment to the existence of entities of that kind.

Is Davidson's argument plausible? (i) Although it is plausible in standard cases, it is unclear how Davidson's account can be extended to manage various sorts of nonstandard modifiers. How, for instance, will Davidson analyze (S)"Sebastian almost strolled" to reveal that (S) entails "Sebastian didn't stroll"? (ii) Terry Horgan objects that Davidson's account is counterintuitive because most adverb constructions do not contain explicit quantification over events. (Horgan,1978, p.47) Horgan is correct, and in light of this, Davidson's argument is significantly weakened if there is an equally attractive or (more damaging yet) superior alternate account of adverbial modification available that does not involve quantification over events. In light of (i) we can add that a competing account would be even more attractive if it could handle non-standard cases of modification that Davidson's theory, as it stands, does not.

Indeed, Horgan has formulated an alternate account that does not involve quantification over events. (Horgan, 1978) Romane Clark's has proposed an extension of standard first order quantification theory to handle predicate modification. (Clark, 1970) Horgan's alternate account involves modifying Clark's proposal in such a way that it does not appeal to states of affairs, which are frequently taken as ontological kinds that are either ontologically equivalent to events or include events as a subcategory. Instead, Horgan appeals to set theory, which is already appealed to in formal semantics. In light of this should we apply Occam's Razor and deny the existence of events? This move would be premature. Davidson has provided a number of other reasons to quantify over events: "I do not believe we can give a cogent account of action, of explanation, of causality, or of the relation between the mental and the physical unless we accept events as individuals."(Davidson, 1980, p.165) If any of these other considerations are apt, then quantification over events would be in order even if the Horgan/Clark proposal is superior, on balance, to Davidson's account. Should all of the other considerations fail, the issue will turn on the problem of adverbial modification and any decision on this matter surely requires a detailed treatment of the relative advantages and disadvantages of each of the proposals.

This concludes the treatment of Davidson’s extensive work on events. Davidson obviously takes events very seriously, going as far as arguing that there are a number of reasons to quantify over them. Lewis, in contrast, has a rather opportunistic approach to events: he fashions a theory of events primarily to suit the theoretical needs of his theories of explanation and causation. Nonetheless, Lewis’s theory is regarded by many as being important in its own right.

3. David Lewis’s Theory of Events

The core conception of Lewis' theory of events is that an event is a property of spatiotemporal regions. (Lewis, 1986, p. 244) Properties, like events, are not basic to Lewis' ontological scheme. Lewis holds that, “By a property I mean simply a class. To have the property is to belong to the class. All the things that have the property, whether actual or merely possible, belong…The property that corresponds to an event, then, is the class of all regions, at most one per world – where the event occurs.” (Lewis, 1986, 244) This being said, Lewis proposes the following necessary condition for some entity e's being an event:

(LT) e is an event only if it is a class of spatio-temporal regions, both thisworldy (assuming it occurs in the actual world) and otherworldly.

(LT) is a rough, first approximation of a theory of events. It only tells us which entities are formally eligible to be events -- only such entities that are a class of thisworldly (assuming it occurs) and otherworldly spacetime regions. Any member of the class that is the event "occurs"; the event, itself, understood as the class, doesn't occur. This would be a kind of category mistake because classes, as abstract entities, don't occur, although they can exist.

We can get an intuitive grip on (LT) by noting a certain commonality with the previously discussed Quine-Davidson account of events, which holds that events are individuated by their spacetime locations: no two events can occupy the same spacetime location. Recall that one criticism of this theory of events is that it treats the simultaneous rotating and the heating of the sphere as being, counterintuitively, the same event. It can be noted that, in contrast, this is not a drawback for Lewis' account. The Quine-Davidson account identified an event with a certain spacetime region; Lewis, in contrast, can say that an occurrence of an event can be located in the same region that another event is, claiming that the events, as classes, are nonetheless distinct because there will be some member that is in class A that is not in class B, namely, an occurrence in some region that is a member of A and not B. (Here, it is important to bear in mind that the different regions may be at different possible worlds). So it is available to Lewis to characterize the well known case of the sphere that both heats and spins at t as involving two distinct events because the rotating includes otherworldly regions that the heating does not include. So far, so good for Lewis.

But before going further into the strengths and weaknesses of the theory, it is necessary to say more about the theory.

a. Preliminaries

A few preliminary remarks about the process of evaluating Lewis' theory are useful to keep in mind. As noted, Lewis is an event-opportunist, if you will, letting his interest in explanation and especially, his counterfactual analysis of causation dictate his theory of events; Bennett captures Lewis' route nicely:

There remains the less ambitious course of basing judgments about the essences of events on the counterfactual analysis of event causation: start with our firm beliefs about what causes what, put them into their counterfactual form in accordance with the analysis and draw conclusions about what the essences of events must be like if we are not to be convicted of too much error in our causal beliefs. That is the third of my three approaches, and it is the one that Lewis adopts. (Bennett, 1988, p.61)

At least at first blush, there seem to be nothing objectionable about this route into events. After all, even Bennett has urged that our ordinary notion of events is not a notion that leads to a useful philosophical theory of events. Why not, then, begin elsewhere? Perhaps Lewis is less ambitious, but commendably more realistic.

Given this route of entry into a theory of events it is natural that those who are interested in Lewis' influential counterfactual theory of causation would have a particular interest in his theory of events. (Lewis, 1970) Of course, even with a strong antecedent interest in Lewis’s theories of causation and explanation, one might nonetheless turn away from Lewis’s theory if it entails Modal Realism. Those who reject Modal Realism would agree that the following desideratum is a requirement that Lewis' theory of events must satisfy:

D1: That the theory of events be formulable within the ersatz framework.

As is well known, Lewis is operating with a controversial notion of "possible world" according to which possible worlds are as real as this world, some containing flesh and blood creatures, solid mountains and planets, and so forth. Such worlds are non-actual in the sense that they are not in our world, but they are equally real as our world is. A world, according to Lewis, is a big object containing all objects that exist there as parts. (Lewis, 1986, p.69) So a world with a talking donkey is a world that has a talking donkey as a literal part.

Ersatzers attempt to avoid commitment to Lewis' possible worlds, reducing possible worlds to other, more acceptable (but in at least some cases still controversial) sorts of entities. (Armstrong, 1989; Loux, 1980; Plantinga, 1976) Ersatz views hold that instead of a plurality of worlds in the modal realist's sense, there is only one concrete world, with various abstract entities representing ways that our world might have been. Such theories are actualist; they hold that the actual entities represent (in some sense of the word) possibilia. Ersatz views take the abstract-concrete distinction as being well understood, taking the world and the entities that occupy it as being concrete, and taking the representations of the concrete entities as being abstract. There is one correct abstract representation and there are many misrepresentations; the former represents the concrete world, the misrepresentations of the actual world represent the various ways the concrete world might have been.

There are many ersatzers, although not all of the same variety; in contrast, there was only one modal realist -- Lewis himself. (For a variety of ersatz theories see Loux, 1980) So it seems fair to say that D1 must be met by Lewis' theory of events. If it turns out otherwise, even if the theory is clear and consistent, there will be very few adherents to the account of events. The following section lays out the basic details of the theory, then attention focuses on whether D1 is indeed satisfied.

b. The Details of Lewis' Theory

We have investigated Lewis’s claim that some entity is an event only if it is a class of spatio-temporal regions, both thisworldly and otherworldy. We now turn to four more features of the theory.

i. A Non-Duplication Principle

From (LT), the axiom of extensionality, (which holds that two sets are identical if and only if they have all the same members) and the predicate logic, we can derive a non-duplication principle for Lewis events. Recalling that Lewis events are classes we can say:

(NP) (x)(y)(where x and y are events, x and y are different events if and only if there is at least one member of x that is not a member of y, (or vice versa)).

It is important to note that although (NP) may judge two events to be different, it is consistent with (NP) that they not be entirely distinct in the sense that one event may be a proper subset of another. Here the term "different" is used in the sense of "non-identical." Think of "different" as meaning, "at least partly distinct."

ii. Regions

Lewis outlines several features of the operative notion of spacetime regions: "An event occurs in a particular spatiotemporal region. Its region might be small or large; there are collisions of point particles and there are condensations of galaxies, but even the latter occupy regions small by astronomical standards." (Lewis,1983, p. 243) Still, there are certain specifications on what can count as a region, namely, that no event occur in two different regions of a world and that an event occupy an entire region; in other words, an event can't occur in any proper part of a region, although parts of it can. (Lewis, 1983, p.243) Lewis leaves it open whether any region is a region in which an event can occur, writing: "A smallish, connected, convex region may seem a more likely candidate than a widely scattered part of spacetime. But I leave this question unsettled, for lack of clear cases." (Lewis, 1983, p. 243). It is not clear that there really aren’t cases that decide the issue: consider the televising of the Superbowl, it seems scattered throughout the regions of multiple homes, bars, and so forth. This seems a clear case of a very scattered event, although every part of the event is spatially connected.

Lewis says that his theory of events relies on the following assumption:

(A) Regions are individuals that are parts of possible worlds.

He admits that this is controversial but says that he need not defend (A) in his present discussion of events. Given the aforementioned Modal Realist view of possible worlds, we can appreciate the controversial nature of (A).

Now let us ask, can assumption (A) be recast in terms of an ersatz conception of possible worlds? It appears so; indeed, we will now see that desideratum (D1) can be met. That is, the theory of events, including assumption (A), can be recast in terms of an ersatz theory of possible worlds. This point will be illustrated by using a version of linguistic ersatzism.

“Linguistic ersatzism” (LE) is the generic name for the family of modal theories that takes worlds as being constructions out of words of a language; in broad strokes, possibilities are represented via the meanings that words are given. For instance, a typical LE view takes worlds as being maximal consistent sets of sentences (where a set S is maximal iff for every sentence B, S contains either it or its negation, and S is consistent iff it is possible for all the members of S to be true together). Notice that in contrast to Modal Realism, the building blocks of this typical linguistic ersatz view involve relatively uncontroversial entities (sentences and sets of things). (Of course, someone who appeals to ersatz worlds will have her own ontological scheme that is to account for such uncontroversial entities. The particular details will differ – the important thing is that ersatzism, unlike Modal Realism, does not prima facie require anything metaphysically ornate). So let us assume an ersatz theory along the above, generic, lines. As Lewis suggests, the linguistic ersatzer can take a possible individual as a maximal consistent set of open sentences. (Lewis, 1986, p.149) For instance consider what open sentences correspond to Ersatz Hunter Thompson:

Ersatz Thompson: {x is 6' tall, x is the author of Fear and Loathing in Las Vegas, x is in LA on 4/5/77, …}

The set is consistent because it is possible for there to be an object such that all of the open sentences are true of it. It is maximal because for every open sentence with only "x" as the free variable the set contains either the sentence or its negation. We could do the same for regions. In this way regions are not mereological parts of possible worlds but are instead, subsets of ersatz possible worlds taken as sets. So (A) can be modified this way:

(A) Regions are individuals that are subsets of possible worlds.

where "possible worlds" refers to ersatz worlds, e.g., on the view considered here, maximally consistent sets of sentences. We can also understand the following condition

(LT) e is an event only if it is a set of spatio-temporal regions, both thisworldy (assuming it occurs in the actual world ) and otherworldly

As involving sets containing sets (regions according to (A), as members).

Finally, we can note that although Lewis reduces events to properties, and properties to classes of actual and otherworldy regions, the ersatzer need not adopt Lewis' conception of properties to adopt (LT), but can just skip the intermediate step of Lewis' reduction, taking events as classes of regions. Why is this important? First, the ersatzer may reject Lewis' account of properties. Second, doing so avoids circularity worries for the proponents of ersatz theories that employ properties in constructing possible worlds (e.g., Armstrong, Plantinga). (Armstrong, 1989; Plantinga,1976) In any case, even if one wants or needs to adopt Lewis' conception of properties, perhaps the direction of explanation could still be preserved if one adopts two conceptions of properties as Lewis does, one sparse and one abundant, employing the sparse conception in formulating the modal theory. But the ersatzer need not even do this.

iii. Event Essences

Lewis rejects the view that events are structured entities constituted by an essential time, object and property. Consider the nominalization "the death of Socrates at t", while we may pick out the event, Socrates' death, by this nominalization, it is conceivable that the very same death happened sooner. Now it might be reasonable, in this case, to say that the very same event couldn't have had a different (so called) "constitutive" individual or property, but there seem to be other cases suggesting that the "constitutive" property and individual are also problematic: e. g, the firing squad shooting was done by Ned but it could have been done by Ted; the strolling could have been a striding. But this is not to say that Lewis is claiming that events don't have essences; it is just that events aren't structured in a Kimean way, rather, the essences are read off from the similarity between the members. This latter point is perhaps best illustrated by way of example: according to Lewis an event is essentially a change if and only if for each region something changes in it; an event essentially involves Socrates if and only if Socrates (more specifically, a temporal segment of Socrates' counterpart) is present in each region; an event essentially occurs in spacetime region R if and only if each member is either R or a counterpart of R, and so on. (Lewis, 1983, p.248-9)

Essences are not to be mainly extrinsic, such as, for instance, an event that is essentially a widowing, nor are they to be overly varied disjuncts, that is, essences like, “an event that is essentially a walking and another that is essentially a talking." Lewis' rationale for these requirements stems from his interests in tailoring a theory of events to his accounts of explanation and counterfactuals. For instance, he rules out mainly extrinsic events, using the (purported) event of the widowing of Xantippe as an example, on the following grounds:

They offend our sense of economy. We would seem to count the death of Socrates twice over in our inventory of events. . .(2) they stand in relations of non-causal counterfactual dependence to those genuine events in virtue of which they occur. Without the death of Socrates the widowing of Xanthippe would not have occurred. (She might still have been widowed sooner or later. But recall that the widowing of Xanthippe, as I defined it, had its time essentially.). . .(3) They also stand in relations of non-causal counterfactual dependence to other genuine events, events logically independent of them. Without the widowing of Xanthippe, the subsequent cooling of Socrates' body would not have occurred. (For in that case he would not have died when he did.) (Lewis, 1983, p.263)

iv. Fine-Grainedness and Logical Relations Between Events

The needs of Lewis' counterfactual analysis of causation motivate Lewis to adopt a fine-grained notion of event. Suppose that John greets someone, and being rather tense, he says hello loudly. If he wasn't tense he would have merely said hello softly. Lewis claims that two events of greeting occur:

John says "Hello." He says it rather too loudly. Arguably there is one event that occurs which is essentially a saying "hello" and only accidentally loud; it would have occurred even if John had spoken softly. Arguably there is a second event that implies, but is not implied by, the first. This event is essentially a saying "Hello" loudly, and it would not have occurred if John had said "Hello" but said it softly. Both events actually occur, but the second could not have occurred without the first. (Lewis, 1983, p.255)

On this view two events of greeting occur, one with a richer essence than the other. The richer event, call it e1, is essentially a loud greeting and would not have occurred if the greeting was soft, e2 is essentially a greeting and is only accidentally loud. It would have occurred if the greeting was soft. As with Kim's theory, many of those interested in a theory of events that tracks our ordinary event concept would find this result too fine-grained. From the vantage point of Lewis' interests in his theory this unintuitive result is not a serious problem -- again, capturing our ordinary event concept is not Lewis' stated project. Lewis makes his motivation for the fine-grainedness clear in the following passage:

The real reason why we need both events. . . is that they differ causally. An adequate causal account of what happens cannot limit itself to either one of the two. The first event (the weak one) caused Fred to greet John in return. The second one (the strong one) didn't. If the second one had not occurred -- if John hadn't said "Hello" so loudly -- the first one still might have, in which case Fred still would have returned John's greeting. Also there is a difference on the side of causes: the second event was, and the first wasn't, caused inter alia by John's state of tension. (Lewis, 1983, p. 255)

The rather counterintuitive fine-grainedness seems to be a necessary evil. As it happens, the events are regarded as being different in order that the theory of events can satisfy the needs of Lewis’s theory of causation. But doing so raises a problem: to regard the events as being distinct, when coupled with Lewis' counterfactual theory of causation, would yield the undesirable result that the first event causes the second. This would be undesirable because the one event implies the other and intuitively, logically related events do not stand in causal relations with each other. Lewis' way of handling this case is to regard the two events as being different, but not distinct, and to claim that non-distinct events do not stand in causal relations.

4. Conclusion

The selection of a theory of events is not a matter which one decides independently of one’s other metaphysical interests and commitments. In the context of our discussion, we have noted a number of relative strengths and weaknesses which can help to guide the reader’s own selection of a theory of events. Of course, further philosophical developments may yield a theory of events which is more attractive than the approaches discussed here. And there are some truly worthwhile, although less-influential, theories of events that have not been discussed in this article.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, David. A Combinatorial Theory of Possibility, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Bennett, Jonathan Francis. Events and Their Names. Indianapolis: Hackett Pub. Co., 1988.
  • Bennett, Jonathan Francis. “Precis of Events and Their Names,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 51 (1991): 625-628.
  • Brand, Myles. “Identity Conditions for Events.” American Philosophical Quarterly 14 (1997): 329-337.
  • Casati, Roberto, Varzi, Achille, "Events," The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2002 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL =
  • Clark, Romane. “Concerning the Logic of Predicate Modifiers,” Noûs. 4 (1970): 311-335.
  • Davidson, Donald. Essays on Actions and Events. New York: Oxford University Press, 1980.
  • Davidson, Donald. “Reply to Quine on Events,” In Actions and Events: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. eds. Lepore, E. and B. Mc Laughlin. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, pp. 172-176, 1985.
  • Evnine, Simone. Donald Davidson. Stanford: Stanford Univ. Press, 1991.
  • Horgan, Terence. “The Case Against Events,” Philosophical Review 87 (1978): 28-47.
  • Kim, Jaegwan. Supervenience and Mind: Selected Philosophical Essays. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Lewis, David. Counterfactuals. Oxford: Blackwell, 1973.
  • Lewis, David. “New Work for a Theory of Universals,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 61 (1983): 343-377.
  • Lewis, David. Philosophical Papers. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1983.
  • Lewis, David. On the Plurality of Worlds. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1986.
  • Lawrence Lombard, “Ontologies of Events” in Macdonald, Cynthia and Stephen Laurence, Eds. Contemporary Readings in the Foundations of Metaphysics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1998.
  • Loux, Michael. The Possible and the Actual: Readings in the Metaphysics of Modality. New York: Cornell University Press, 1980.
  • Oliver, Alex. “The Metaphysics of Properties,” Mind 105 (1996): 1-80.
  • Plantinga, A., 1976, “Actualism and Possible Worlds,” Theoria 42.
  • Quine, W.V.O. “Events and Reification” in Actions and Events: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. eds. Lepore, E. and B. Mc Laughlin. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, pp. 162-171, 1985.

Author Information

Susan Schneider
Moravian College
U. S. A.

“Brain in a Vat” Argument, The

“The Brain in a Vat” Argument

The Brain in a Vat thought-experiment is most commonly used to illustrate global or Cartesian skepticism. You are told to imagine the possibility that at this very moment you are actually a brain hooked up to a sophisticated computer program that can perfectly simulate experiences of the outside world. Here is the skeptical argument. If you cannot now be sure that you are not a brain in a vat, then you cannot rule out the possibility that all of your beliefs about the external world are false. Or, to put it in terms of knowledge claims, we can construct the following skeptical argument. Let “P” stand for any belief or claim about the external world, say, that snow is white.

  1. If I know that P, then I know that I am not a brain in a vat
  2. I do not know that I am not a brain in a vat
  3. Thus, I do not know that P.

The Brain in a Vat Argument is usually taken to be a modern version of René Descartes' argument (in the Meditations on First Philosophy) that centers on the possibility of an evil demon who systematically deceives us. The hypothesis has been the premise behind the movie The Matrix, in which the entire human race has been placed into giant vats and fed a virtual reality at the hands of malignant artificial intelligence (our own creations, of course).

One of the ways some modern philosophers have tried to refute global skepticism is by showing that the Brain in a Vat scenario is not possible. In his Reason, Truth and History (1981), Hilary Putnam first presented the argument that we cannot be brains in a vat, which has since given rise to a large discussion with repercussions for the realism debate and for central theses in the philosophy of language and mind. As we shall see, however, it remains far from clear how exactly Putnam’s argument should be taken and what it actually proves.

Table of Contents

  1. Skepticism and Realism
  2. Putnam’s argument
  3. Reconstructions of the Argument
  4. Brains in a Vat and Self-Knowledge
  5. Significance of the Argument
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Skepticism and Realism

Putnam’s argument is designed to attack the possibility of global skepticism that is implied by metaphysical realism. Putnam defines metaphysical realism as the view which holds that “…the world consists of some fixed totality of mind-independent objects. There is exactly one true and complete description of ‘the way the world is.’ Truth involves some sort of correspondence relation between words or thought-signs and sets of things.” (1981, 49). This construal brings out the idea that for metaphysical realists, truth is not reducible to epistemic notions but concerns the nature of a mind-independent reality. This characterization finds an accurate target in those scientific materialists who believe in a “ready-made” world of scientific kinds independent of human classification and conceptualization. There are, however, many self-professed metaphysical realists who are not happy with Putnam’s definition; it saddles the realist with the classical difficulty of matching words to objects and of providing for a correspondence relation between sentences and mind-independent “facts.” The metaphysical realist is forced to construe her thesis ontologically, as an adherence to some fixed furniture of objects in the world, which ignores the possibility that ontological commitment may be specified not as a commitment to a set of entities but rather to the truth of a class of sentences or even of whole theories of the world.

One proposal is to construe metaphysical realism as the position that there are no a priori epistemically derived constraints on reality (Gaifman, 1993). By stating the thesis negatively, the realist sidesteps the thorny problems concerning correspondence or a “ready made” world, and shifts the burden of proof on the challenger to refute the thesis. One virtue of this construal is that it defines metaphysical realism at a sufficient level of generality to apply to all philosophers who currently espouse metaphysical realism. For Putnam’s metaphysical realist will also agree that truth and reality cannot be subject to “epistemically derived constraints.” This general characterization of metaphysical realism is enough to provide a target for the Brains in a Vat argument. For there is a good argument to the effect that if metaphysical realism is true, then global skepticism is also true, that is, it is possible that all of our referential beliefs about the world are false. As Thomas Nagel puts it, “realism makes skepticism intelligible,” (1986, 73) because once we open the gap between truth and epistemology, we must countenance the possibility that all of our beliefs, no matter how well justified, nevertheless fail to accurately depict the world as it really is. [See Fallibilism.] Donald Davidson also emphasizes this aspect of metaphysical realism: “metaphysical realism is skepticism in one of its traditional garbs. It asks: why couldn’t all my beliefs hang together and yet be comprehensively false about the actual world?” (1986, 309)

The Brain in a Vat scenario is just an illustration of this kind of global skepticism: it depicts a situation where all our beliefs about the world would presumably be false, even though they are well justified. Thus if one can prove that we cannot be brains in a vat, by modus tollens one can prove that metaphysical realism is false. Or, to put it in more schematic form:

  1. If metaphysical realism is true, then global skepticism is possible
  2. If global skepticism is possible, then we can be brains in a vat
  3. But we cannot be brains in a vat
  4. Thus, metaphysical realism is false (1,2,3)

This article focuses mostly on claim (3), although some philosophers question (2), believing there may be ways of presenting the skeptical thesis even while granting Putnam’s argument.

2. Putnam’s argument

The major premise that underwrites Putnam’s argument is what he calls a “causal constraint” on reference:

(CC) A term refers to an object only if there is an appropriate causal connection between that term and the object

To understand this criterion we need to unravel what is meant by “appropriate causal connection.” If an ant were to accidentally draw a picture of Winston Churchill in the sand, few would claim that the ant represented or referred to Churchill. Similarly, if I accidentally sneeze “Genghis Khan,” just because I verbalize the words does not mean that I refer to the infamous Mongolian conqueror, for I may have never heard of him before. Reference cannot simply be an accident: or, as Putnam puts it, words do not refer to objects “magically” or intrinsically. Now establishing just what would count as necessary and sufficient conditions for a term to refer to an object turns out to be tricky business, and there have been many “causal theories” of reference supplied to do just that. Many have taken the virtue of Putnam’s constraint (CC) to be its generality: it merely states a necessary condition for reference and need not entail anything more controversial. Sometimes it is claimed that endorsing (CC) commits you to semantic externalism but the issues are more complex, since many internalists (for example, John Searle) appear to agree with (CC). The relation between externalism and Putnam’s argument will be considered in more detail later (in the section “Brains in a Vat and Self-Knowledge”).

With the causal constraint established, Putnam goes on to describe the Brain in a Vat scenario. It is important to note exactly what the thought-experiment is, for failure to appreciate the ways in which Putnam has changed the standard skeptical nightmare has lead to many mistaken “refutations” of the argument. The standard picture has a mad-scientist (or race of aliens, or AI programs…) envatting brains in a laboratory then inducing a virtual reality through a sophisticated computer program. On this picture, there is an important difference between viewing the brains from a first or third person viewpoint. There is the point of view of the brains in a vat (henceforth BIVs), and the point of view of someone outside the vat. Clearly when the mad-scientist says “that is a brain in a vat” of a BIV, he would be saying something true, no matter the question of what the BIV means when it says it is a brain in a vat. Furthermore, presumably a BIV could pick up referential terms by borrowing them from the mad-scientist. Thus when a BIV says “there is a tree” referring to a simulation of a tree, it would be saying something false, since its term “tree,” picked up from the mad-scientist to refer to an actual tree, in fact refers to something else, like his sense-impressions of the tree. Putnam thus stipulates that all sentient beings are brains in a vat, hooked up to one another through a powerful computer that has no programmer: “that’s just how the universe is.” We are then asked, given at least the physical possibility of this scenario, whether we could say or think it. Putnam answers that we could not: the assertion “we are brains in a vat” would be sense self-refuting in the same way that the general statement “all general statements are false” is.

The thought-experiment stipulates that brains in a vat would have qualitatively identical thoughts to those unenvatted; or at least they have the same “notional world.” The difference is that in the vat-world, there are no external objects. When a BIV says “There is a tree in front of me,” there is in fact no tree in front of him, only a simulated tree produced by the computer’s program. However, if there are no trees, there could be no causal connection between a BIV’s tokens of trees and actual trees. By (CC), “tree” does not refer to tree. This leads to some interesting consequences.

A standard reading of a BIV’s utterance of “There is a tree” would have the statement come out false, since there are no trees for the BIV to refer to. But that would be only assuming that “tree” refers to tree in the BIV’s language. If “tree” does not refer to tree, then the semantic evaluation of the sentence becomes unclear. Sometimes Putnam suggests that a BIV’s tokens refer to images or sense-impressions. At other times he agrees with Davidson who claims that the truth-conditions would be facts about the electronic impulses of the computer that are causally responsible for producing the sense-impressions. Davidson has a good reason to choose these truth-conditions: through the principle of charity he would want to interpret the BIV’s sentences to come out true, but he would not want the truth-conditions to be phenomenalistic. Thus it turns out that when a BIV says “There is a tree in front of me,” he is saying something true—if in fact the computer is sending the right impulses to him.

Another suggestion is that the truth-conditions of the BIV’s utterances would be empty: the BIV asserts nothing at all. This seems to be rather strong, however: surely the BIV would mean something when it utters “There is a tree in front of me,” even if its statement gets evaluated differently because of the radical difference of its environment. One thing is clear, however; a BIV’s tokening of “tree” or any other such referential term would have a different reference assignment from that of a non-envatted person’s tokenings. According to (CC), my tokening of “tree” refers to trees because there is an appropriate causal link between it and actual trees (assuming of course I am not a BIV). A brain in a vat however would not be able to refer to trees since there are no trees (and even if there were trees there would not be the appropriate causal relation between its tokenings of “tree” and real trees, unless we bring back the standard fantasy and assume it picked up the terms from the mad scientist). Now one might be inclined to think that because there are at least brains and vats in the universe, a BIV would be able to refer to brains and vats. But the tokening of “brain” is never actually caused by a brain except only in the very indirect sense that its brain causes all of its tokenings. The minimal constraint (CC) then will ensure that “brain” and “vat” in the BIV language does not refer to brain and vat.

We are now in a position to give Putnam’s argument. It has the form of a conditional proof :

  1. Assume we are brains in a vat
  2. If we are brains in a vat, then “brain” does not refer to brain, and “vat” does not refer to vat (via CC)
  3. If “brain in a vat” does not refer to brains in a vat, then “we are brains in a vat” is false
  4. Thus, if we are brains in a vat, then the sentence “We are brains in a vat” is false (1,2,3)

Putnam adds that “we are brains in a vat” is necessarily false, since whenever we assume it is true we can deduce its contradictory. The argument is valid and its soundness seems to depend on the truth of (3), assuming (CC) is true. One immediate problem is determining the truth-conditions for “we are brains in a vat” on the assumption we are brains in a vat, speaking a variation of English (call it Vatese). From (CC) we know that “brains in a vat” does not refer to brain in a vat. But it doesn’t follow from this alone that “we are brains in a vat” is false. Compare:

(A) “Grass is green” is true iff grass is green
(B) “Grass is green” is true iff one has sense-impressions of grass being green
(C) “Grass is green” is true iff one is in electronic state Q

On the assumption that we are brains in a vat, (CC) would appear to rule out (A): “grass” does not refer to grass since there is no appropriate causal connection between “grass” and actual grass. Thus the truth-conditions for the statement “grass is green” would be nonstandard. If we take them to be those captured in (B), then “Grass is green” as spoken by a brain in a vat would be true. Consequently the truth-conditions for “we are brains in a vat” would be captured by (D):

(D) “We are brains in a vat” is true iff we have sense impressions of being brains in a vat

On this construal of the truth-conditions, “We are brains in a vat” as uttered by a BIV would presumably be false, since a brain in a vat would not have sense-impressions of being a brain in a vat: recall a BIV’s notional world would be equivalent to the unenvatted, and he would appear to himself to be a normally embodied person with a real body etc. However, if we follow Davidson and adopt the truth-conditions of (C), we would have the following:

(E) “We are brains in a vat” is true if and only if we are in electronic state Q

Now it is no longer clear that “We are brains in a vat” is false: for if the brain is in the appropriate electronic state, the truth-conditions could well be fulfilled. There are other reconstructions of the argument that do not depend on specifying the truth-conditions of a BIV’s utterances. What is important is the idea that the truth-conditions would be non-standard, as in:

(F) “We are brains in a vat” is true if and only if we are BIVs*

Now since being a BIV* (whatever that is) is not the same as being a BIV, we can construct the following conditional proof argument:

  1. Assume we are BIVs
  2. If we are BIVs, “we are brains in a vat” is true if and only we are BIVs*
  3. If we are BIVs, we are not BIVs*
  4. If we are BIVs, then “we are BIVs” is false (2,3)
  5. If we are BIVs, then we are not BIVs (4)

Notice that the argument leaves the antecedent of the conditional open, what Wright calls an “open subjunctive.” We do not want the premises of the argument to be counterfactual, following the train of thought “If we were brains in a vat, the causal constraint would entail that my words ‘brain in a vat’ would come to denote something different, BIV*.” For then we would be assuming that we are not brains in a vat, when that is what the argument is supposed to prove.

Nevertheless, there are still problems with the appeal to disquotation to get us from (4) to (5). Even if, by virtue of the causal constraint, the sentence “We are BIVs” is false, an intuitive objection runs that this change of language should not entail falsity of the proposition that we are brains in a vat. As we shall see, many recent reconstructions of Putnam’s argument are sensitive to this point and try to account for it in various ways. In the following section, I shall focus on two of the more popular reconstructions of the argument put forward by Brueckner (1986) and Wright (1994).

3. Reconstructions of the Argument

Brueckner (1986) argues that even if we grant the reasoning of the above argument up to (4), the most the argument proves is that if we are brains in a vat, then the sentence “We are brains in a vat” (as uttered by a BIV) is false, and that if we are not brains in a vat, then “We are brains in a vat” is false (now expressing a different false proposition). If correct then the argument would prove that whether or not we are brains in a vat, “we are brains in a vat” expresses some false proposition. Assuming the truth-conditions of a BIV would be those captured in (D) we could then devise the following constructive dilemma type argument:

  1. Either I am a BIV or I am not a BIV
  2. If I am a BIV, then “I am a BIV” is true iff I have sense impressions of being a BIV
  3. If I am a BIV, then I do not have sense-impressions of being a BIV
  4. If I am a BIV, then “I am a BIV” is false (2,3)
  5. If I am not a BIV, then “I am a BIV” is true iff I am a BIV
  6. If I am not a BIV, then “I am a BIV” is false (5)
  7. “I am a BIV” is false (1, 4, 6)

If “I am a BIV” expresses the proposition that I am a brain in a vat, and we know from the argument that “I am a BIV” is false, then it follows that I know I am not a brain in a vat, thus refuting premise (2) of the skeptical argument. However, can I know that “I am a brain in a vat” expresses the proposition that I am a brain in a vat? If I am a brain in a vat, then “I am a brain in a vat” would, via the causal constraint on reference, express some different proposition (say, that I am a brain in a vat in the image). So even if “I am a BIV” is false whether or not I am a BIV, I might not be in the position to identify which false proposition I am expressing, in which case I cannot claim to know that my sentence “I am not a brain in a vat” expresses the true proposition that I am not a brain in a vat.

Some philosophers have gone even further, claiming that if the argument ends here, it actually can be used to strengthen skepticism. The metaphysical realist can claim that there are truths not expressible in any language: perhaps the proposition that we are brains in a vat is true, even if no one can meaningfully utter it. As Nagel puts it:

If I accept the argument, I must conclude that a brain in a vat can’t think truly that it is a brain in a vat, even though others can think this about it. What follows? Only that I cannot express my skepticism by saying “Perhaps I am a brain in a vat.” Instead I must say “Perhaps I can’t even think the truth about what I am, because I lack the necessary concepts and my circumstances make it impossible for me to acquire them!” If this doesn’t qualify as skepticism, I don’t know what does. (Nagel, 1986)

Putnam makes it clear that he is not merely talking about semantics: he wants to provide a metaphysical argument that we cannot be brains in a vat, not just a semantic one that we cannot assert we are. If he is just proving something about meaning, it is open for the skeptic to say that the bonds between language and reality can diverge radically, perhaps in ways we can never discern.

There is yet another worry with the argument, centering once again on the appropriate characterization of the truth-conditions in (2). If one claimed in response to the above objection that in fact I do know that “I am a brain in a vat” expresses the proposition that I am a brain in a vat (whether or not I am a brain in a vat), one may have in mind some general disquotation principle:

(DQ): “Grass is green” is true iff grass is green

If it is an a priori truth that any meaningful sentence in my language homophonically disquotes, then we can a priori know that the following is also true:

(F): “I am a brain in a vat” is true iff I am a brain in a vat

Here is the obvious problem: if we are not to beg the question, we have to be open to the possibility that we are brains in a vat, speaking Vatese. Then we would get:

(G): If I am a BIV, then “I am a BIV” is true iff I am a brain in a vat.

However, (G) gives us truth-conditions that differ from premise (2) of Brueckner’s argument:

(2) If I am a BIV, then “I am a BIV” is true iff I have sense-impressions of being a BIV

If we assume (CC), then (G) and (2) are inconsistent, since the term “BIV” would refer to distinct entities. No contradiction ensues if we assume we are speaking in English: for then (G) would presumably be false (appealing to CC). But the problem is that we cannot beg the question by assuming we are speaking in English: if we assume that, then we know in advance of any argument that we are not speaking in Vatese and hence that we are not brains in a vat. But if we do not know which language we are speaking in, then we cannot properly assert (2).

One response to this is to formulate two different arguments, one whose meta-language is in English, the other whose meta-language is in Vatese, and show that distinct arguments can be run to prove that “I am a BIV” is false. Even if successful, however, these arguments run into the objection canvassed before: if I do not know which language I am speaking in, even if I know “I am a brain in a vat” is false, I do not know which false proposition I am expressing and hence cannot infer that I know that I am not a brain in a vat.

Similar worries plague Crispin’s Wright’s popular formulation of the argument (1994):

  1. My language disquotes
  2. In BIVese, “brains in a vat” does not refer to brains in a vat
  3. In my language, “brains in a vat” is a meaningful expression
  4. In my language, “brains in a vat” refers to brains in a vat
  5. My language is not BIVese (2,4)
  6. If I am a BIV, then my language is BIVese
  7. I am not a BIV

There are several virtues to this reconstruction: first of all, it gets us to the desired conclusion without specifying what the truth-conditions of a BIV’s utterances would be. They could be sense-impressions, facts about electronic impulses, or the BIV’s sentences may not refer at all. All that is needed for the argument is that there is a difference between the truth-conditions for a BIV’s sentences and those of my own language. The other virtue of the argument is that it clearly brings out the appeal to the disquotation principle that was implicit in the previous arguments. If indeed (DQ) is an a priori truth, as many philosophers maintain, and if we accept (CC) as a condition of reference, the argument appears to be sound. So have we proven that we are not brains in a vat?

Not so fast. The previous objection can be restated: if I do not yet know whether or not I am a brain in a vat before the argument is completed, I do not know which language I am speaking (English or Vatese). If I am speaking Vatese, then so long as it is a meaningful language, I can appeal to disquotation to establish that “brains in a vat” does refer to brains in a vat. But this contradicts premise (2). The problem seems to be that (DQ) is being used too liberally. Clearly we do not want to say that every meaningful term disquotes in the strong sense required for reference. If so, we could take it to be an a priori truth that “Santa Claus” refers to Santa Claus. But “Santa Claus” does not refer to Santa Claus, since there is no Santa Claus. We could introduce a new term “pseudo-reference” and hold that “Santa Claus” pseudo-refers to Santa Claus, and then attach further conditions on reference in order to establish what it would take for the term to truly refer. One proposal (Weiss, 2000) is the following principle:

W: If “x” psuedo-refers to x in L, and x exists, then “x” refers to x in L

Thus, given the disquotation principle we know that in my language “Santa Claus” pseudo-refers to Santa Claus. Supposing to the joyful adulation of millions that Santa Claus is discovered to actually exist, then given (W) “Santa Claus” refers to Santa Claus. Now this also seems too simplistic: as Putnam pointed out, in order for a term to refer to an object we must establish more than the mere existence of the object. There has to be the appropriate causal relation between the word and object, or we are back to claiming that in accidentally sneezing “Genghis Khan” I am referring to Genghis Khan. But whether we accept (W) or attach stronger conditions to reference, it is clear that any such move would make Wright’s formulation invalid. For then we would have:

  1. My language disquotes
  2. In BIVese, “brains in a vat” does not refer to brains in a vat (CC)
  3. In my language “brain in a vat” is a meaningful expression
  4. In my language, “brain in a vat” pseudo-refers to brains in a vat (DQ)
  5. My language is not BIVese (2,4)
  6. If I am a BIV, then my language is BIVese
  7. I am not a BIV

(5) no longer follows from (2) and (4) given the ambiguity of “refers” in (2) and (4). If on the other hand we insist on a univocal sense of reference, then either (2) will contradict the (DQ) principle, or we are not entitled to appeal to (1), insofar as it would beg the question that we are speaking English, a language for which the (DQ) principle applies.

4. Brains in a Vat and Self-Knowledge

Ted Warfield (1995) has sought to provide an argument that we are not brains in a vat based on considerations of self-knowledge. He defends two premises that seem reasonably true, and then he argues for the desired metaphysical conclusion:

  1. I think that water is wet
  2. No brain in a vat can think that water is wet
  3. Thus, I am not a brain in a vat (2.3)

Premise (1) is said to follow from the thesis of privileged access, which holds that we can at least know the contents of our own occurring thoughts without empirical investigation of our environment or behavior. Warfield’s strategy is to present each premise as non-question begging against the global skeptic, in which case at no point can we appeal to the external environment as justification. Since the thesis of privileged access is said to be known a priori whether we are brains in a vat or not, premise (1) can be known non-empirically.

Premise (2) is a little trickier to establish non-empirically. The main argument for it is by analogy with other arguments in the literature that have been used to establish content externalism. The main strategy is derived from Putnam’s Twin Earth argument (1975): imagine a world that is indistinguishable from Earth except for one detail: the odorless, drinkable liquid that flows in the rivers and oceans is composed of the chemicals XYZ and not H20. If we take Oscar on Earth and his twin on Twin-earth, Putnam argues that they would refer to two different substances and hence mean two different things: when Oscar says “pass me some water” he refers to H20 and means water, but when Twin-Oscar says “pass me some water” he refers to XYZ and thus means twin-water. As Burge and others have pointed out, if the meaning of their words are different, then the concepts that compose their beliefs should differ as well, in which case Oscar would believe that water is wet whereas Twin-Oscar would believe that twin-water is wet. While Putnam’s original slogan was “meanings just ain’t in the head,” the argument can be extended to beliefs as well: “beliefs just ain’t in the head,” but depend crucially on the layout of one’s environment.

If we accept content externalism, then the motivation for (2) is as follows. In order for someone’s belief to be about water, there must be water in that person’s environment: externalism rejects the Cartesian idea that one can simply read off one’s belief internally (if so then we would have to say that Oscar and his twin have the same beliefs since they are internally the same). So it doesn’t seem possible that a BIV could ever come to hold a belief about water (unless of course he picked up the term from the mad-scientist or someone outside the vat, but here we must assume again Putnam’s scenario that there is no mad-scientist or anyone else he could have borrowed the term from). As Warfield puts it, premise (2) is a conceptual truth, established on the basis of Twin-earth style arguments, a matter of “armchair” a priori reflection and thus able to be established non-empirically.

The problem with establishing (2) non-empirically though is that the externalist arguments succeed only on the assumption that our own use of “water” refers to a substantial kind, and this seems to be a matter of empirical investigation. Imagine a world where “water” does not refer to any liquid substance but is rather a complex hallucination that never gets discovered. On this “Dry Earth,” “water” would not refer to a substantial kind but rather a superficial kind. The analogy to the BIV case is clear: since it is not an a priori truth that “water” refers to a substantial kind in the BIV’s language, it cannot be known non-empirically that “water” is substantial or superficial; if it is a superficial kind, then a BIV could very well think that water is wet so long as it has the relevant sense-impressions.

5. Significance of the Argument

Some philosophers have claimed that even if Putnam’s argument is sound, it doesn’t do much to dislodge Cartesian or global skepticism. Crispin Wright (1994) argues that the argument does not affect certain versions of the Cartesian nightmare, such as my brain being taken out of my skull last night and hooked up to a computer. Someone of a Positivist bent might argue that if there is no empirical evidence to appeal to in order to establish whether we are brains in a vat or not, then the hypothesis is meaningless, in which case we do not need an argument to refute it. While few philosophers today would hold onto such a strong verifiability theory of meaning, many would maintain that such metaphysical possibilities do not amount to real cases of doubt and thus can be summarily dismissed. Still others see the possibility of being a brain in a vat an important challenge for cognitive science and the attempt to create a computer model of the world that can simulate human cognition. Dennett (1991) for example has argued that it is physically impossible for a brain in a vat to replicate the qualitative phenomenology of a non-envatted human being. Nevertheless, one should hesitate before making possibility claims when it comes to future technology. And as films like the Matrix, Existenz, and even the Truman Show indicate, the idea of living in a simulated world indistinguishable from the real one is likely to continue to fascinate the human mind for many years to come—whether or not it is a brain in a vat.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Boghossian, Paul. 1999. What the Externalist can Know A Priori. Philosophical Issues 9
  • Brueckner, Anthony. 1986. Brains in a Vat. Journal of Philosophy 83: 148-67
  • Brueckner, Anthony. 1992. If I am a Brain in a vat, then I am not a Brain in a Vat. Mind 101:123-128
  • Burge, T. 1982. Other Bodies. In A. Woodfield. Ed., Thought and Object: Essays on Intentionality. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 91-120.
  • Casati, R. and Dokic J. 1991. Brains in a Vat, Language and Metalanguage. Analysis 51: 91-93.
  • Collier, J. 1990. Could I Conceive Being a Brain in a Vat? Australasian Journal of Philosophy 68: 413-419.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1986. “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge,” in Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Davies, D. 1995. Putnam’s Thought-Teaser. Canadian Journal of Philosophy 25(2):203-227.
  • Ebbs, G. (1992), “Skepticism, Objectivity and Brains in Vats”, Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 73
  • Forbes, G. 1995. Realism and Skepticism: Brains in a Vat Revisited. Journal of Philosophy 92(4): 205-222
  • Gaifman, Haim. 1994. Metaphysical Realism and Vats in a Brain. (unpublished ms)
  • Nagel, Thomas. 1986. The View from Nowhere. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Noonan, Harold. 1998. Reflections on Putnam, Wright and brains in a vat. Analysis 58:59-62
  • Putnam, Hilary 1975. The Meaning of “Meaning.” Mind, Language and Reality: Philosophical Papers, Vol 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1982. Reason, Truth and History. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1994. Reply to Wright. In P. Clark and B. Hale, eds. Reading Putnam. Oxford, Blackwell.
  • Sawyer, Sarah. 1999. My Language Disquotes. Analysis, vol. 59:3: 206-211
  • Smith, P. (1984), Could We Be Brains in a Vat?, Canadian Journal of Philosophy 14
  • Steinitz, Y. Brains in a vat? Different Perspectives. Philosophical Quarterly 44 (175): 213-222
  • Tymoczko, T. 1989. In Defense of Putnam’s Brains. Philosophical Studies 57(3) 281-297
  • Warfield, Ted. 1995. Knowing the World and Knowing our Minds. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 55 (3): 525-545.
  • Weiss, B. 2000. Generalizing Brains in a Vat. Analysis 60: 112-123
  • Wright, Crispin. 1994. On Putnam’s Proof that we cannot be brains in a vat. In P. Clark and B. Hale. Eds, Reading Putnam. Oxford: Blackwell.

Author Information

Lance P. Hickey
Southern Connecticut State University
U. S. A.

Peirce, Charles Sanders: Architectonic Philosophy

Charles Sanders Peirce: Architectonic Philosophy

peirceThe subject matter of architectonic is the structure of all human knowledge. The purpose of providing an architectonic scheme is to classify different types of knowledge and explain the relationships that exist between these classifications. The architectonic system of C. S. Peirce (1839-1914) divides knowledge according to it status as a "science" and then explains the interrelation of these different scientific disciplines. His belief was that philosophy must be placed within this systematic account of knowledge as science. Peirce adopts his architectonic ambitions of structuring all knowledge, and organizing philosophy within it, from his great philosophical hero, Kant. This systematizing approach became crucial for Peirce in his later work. However, his belief in a structured philosophy related systematically to all other scientific disciplines was important to him throughout his philosophical life.

Table of Contents

  1. The Architectonic System
  2. Mathematics and Philosophy
  3. Philosophy
    1. Phenomenology
    2. The Normative Sciences
      1. Aesthetics and Ethics
      2. Logic
    3. Metaphysics
  4. The Importance of the Systematic Interpretation
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. The Architectonic System

In later work, Peirce began to organize and systematize his philosophy in terms of its relation to other areas of knowledge. More crucially for his philosophy, though, this enabled him to make explicit the structure and interrelation of different areas of his philosophical thought. In work like his 1902 Carnegie Institute Application, letters to friends, and more conventional writings, Peirce placed his philosophy within a hierarchical classification of sciences. Within this systematization of sciences, "science" is a broad term meaning any organization of human knowledge. The result is that disciplines like history, biographical study and art criticism count as "science." The sheer number of sciences involved in Peirce's classification, then, meant that he needed to sub-divide them further. The basis of Peirce's sub-divisions is not altogether clear or straightforward, but he seems to count Philosophy as a "formal science of discovery." What Peirce means by this is that Philosophy is concerned with discovering the formal or necessary conditions for the objects with which it concerns itself. Whether this is an accurate classification of philosophy is hard to say, but the idea is that philosophy shares some formal (i.e. quest for necessary conditions) concerns with mathematics and shares a concern for discovering knowledge with the empirical or physical sciences, like chemistry or physics; hence philosophy is a "formal science of discovery." The hierarchical classification of sciences in relation to philosophy and the hierarchical structure of philosophy itself, then, looks, roughly, as follows:



which consists of:

a) Phenomenology

b) Normative Science

which consists of:



iii) LOGIC

which consists of:

a) Philosophical Grammar

b) Critical Logic

c) Methodeutic

c) Metaphysics

Figure 1

In creating a systematized classification of science, Peirce hoped to make the connection between different areas of his thought clear, not only to others, but also to himself. If Peirce was able to see how his pragmatism, say, was related to other areas of his philosophy, and how his philosophy in general related to other sciences, he might be able to gain insights into the theory of pragmatism as a consequence. Peirce was, however, aware that a systematic classification of sciences is, to some extent, an abstraction that simplifies the relations between sciences. For the most part, though, he found that it accurately represented his thoughts on philosophy and was a useful tool for organizing his theories.

As suggested already, the sciences and philosophy are organized in a hierarchical fashion. So, from Figure 1., we can see that Mathematics is super-ordinate to philosophy, and philosophy super-ordinate to the physical sciences. Similar relations of super and sub-ordinacy also exist within philosophy and within particular branches of philosophy. The first thing to clarify is that the sub-ordinacy of philosophy to mathematics, or metaphysics to phenomenology, is not sub-ordinacy in the sense of embeddedness, i.e., philosophy is not a sub-branch of mathematics. Of course, embedded sub-ordinacy does occur in Peirce's classification where, for instance, aesthetics is a sub-branch of Normative Science, just as ethics and logic are. However, ethics and logic are not sub-branches of aesthetics, even though they are sub-ordinate to it. So, what is the nature of the non-embedded sub-ordinacy of, say, philosophy to mathematics?

Non-embedded sub-ordinacy is more a notion of linear priority than topical subsumption. This is because Peirce is organizing sciences in a fashion popularized by Auguste Comte in the nineteenth century, whereby super-ordinate sciences provide general laws or principles for sub-ordinate sciences which provide concrete, realized cases of those general principles. Super-ordinacy, then, is meant to be linear priority in terms of prior provision of general principles, and sub-ordinacy, the posterior realization of those general principles. A contrived example of how this works may go something as follows:

Psychology provides general principles that suggest that the emotional states of human beings are manipulable through sound, i.e., human emotion is susceptible to auditory suggestion. Using that principle, musicians can discover that musical arrangements in minor keys, particularly D minor, invoke sadness amongst listeners. Wagner, for instance, discovered that all chords have a corresponding chord which "resolves" the sequence, leaving the listener satisfied. By consistently refusing to "resolve" chords in his music, Wagner was able to induce tension and anxiety amongst his listeners wherever he wished to do so. These cases of actual musical practice provide concrete, confirming phenomena of the general psychological principle. Psychology, then, is super-ordinate to music, in the sense that it provides general principles for musical practice.

Applied to the hierarchy in figure 1., mathematics provides general laws, which Peirce often calls guiding or leading principles, for philosophy. Philosophy, in turn, provides concrete or confirming cases of those laws. Similar relations exist within philosophy itself, and between philosophy and the empirical sciences. Peirce is not always forthcoming with explicit examples of guiding principles, but, as we shall examine in more detail below, in the case of philosophy and its super-ordinate science, mathematics, he gives us a good indication of what he has in mind.

2. Mathematics and Philosophy

Peirce divides mathematics into three areas that correspond roughly to discrete mathematics, mathematics of the infinite, and mathematical or formal logic. We now think of Peirce's groundbreaking work in mathematical logic as belonging to logic proper rather than being a branch of mathematics. More important though is the role of mathematics as the provider of guiding principles for subsequent sciences, and particularly philosophy. Following his father, Peirce treated mathematics as "the science which draws necessary conclusions." What Peirce means is that mathematics is free from existential concerns about its constructs. In this sense, it is hypothetical and abstract. Peirce, for instance, states that mathematics "makes constructions in the imagination according to abstract precepts, and then observes these imaginary objects, finding in them relations of parts not specified in the precept of construction." What Peirce means is that mathematics creates hypothetical constructions, i.e., constructions which are abstracted and not necessarily actual, and then derives logically necessary connections between them and about them. These "necessary conclusions" about mathematical constructs provide general laws or principles for deriving logically necessary connections between and about all constructs, imaginary or actual. In short, the kinds of reasoning employed in mathematics provide general rules of reasoning, and function as principles to guide our reasoning in subsequent science, particularly philosophy.

For example, we can see the provision of guiding or leading principles from mathematics through the following story about irrational numbers. An irrational number is a number which cannot be expressed as the ratio of two integers. That is, the irrational number is a non-terminating, non-repeating decimal. How did our number systems develop to include numbers other than rational integers? One thought is that Pythagoras realized that there necessarily exists no pair of rational integers such that one can be expressed as the twice the square of the other. The way he came to this conclusion is by noting that in a square whose sides measure one unit in length, the diagonal measures neither one unit nor two units. Consequently, there must exist some other kind of non-rational number which enables us to explain the length of a square's diagonal in relation to its sides. Now, the way in which Pythagoras came about this conclusion was to note certain features about some diagram (of a square), abstract important features from that particular case, and draw a more general conclusion. These methods of abstraction and generalization are precisely the kind of thing that Peirce has in mind when he says that mathematics, as a super-ordinate science, provides guiding principles for philosophy.

3. Philosophy

Philosophy is divided into three orders: phenomenology, or the science of how things appear to us; the normative sciences, which study how we ought to act; and metaphysics, the study of what is real. Philosophy takes from mathematics the principles of drawing necessary consequences from hypotheses. Further, the three branches of philosophy have hierarchical relationships. Phenomenology uses the principles of mathematics and theorizes on the necessary qualities that all phenomena must have. After this, the normative and metaphysical sciences use, reflect and provide concrete cases of these phenomenological findings.

Similar divisions occur within the branches of philosophy but the most interesting of these is the division within normative science between aesthetics, ethics and logic. Logic within normative science is conceived as semiotics, or the study of signs, and is strongly epistemological in its concern with the structure of knowledge and understanding. As the hierarchy suggests, logic is dependent upon ethics and ethics upon aesthetics. All of these are dependent upon the principles of phenomenology and, more broadly still, upon mathematics. Further, they are all super-ordinate to metaphysics. This is largely because metaphysics concerns itself with the reality and place within nature of these objects. Metaphysics, as the science of what is real, is most similar to the physical sciences and is in many ways meant to be a bridging discipline between philosophy and natural science. As should be clear, the hierarchy moves from abstract disciplines to those whose study involves phenomena that are more concrete.

We know how the three philosophical sub-disciplines are meant to relate to each other in terms of the hierarchy. However, we have yet to examine Peirce's theories of phenomenology, normative science, and metaphysics in any detail. In the following sections, though, we shall examine each of the three sub-disciplines, and in the case of normative science its sub-sub-disciplines, and look a little more closely at what Peirce take these topics to concern.

a. Phenomenology

The first and most abstract of philosophy's sub-disciplines is phenomenology. For Peirce, phenomenology is the science of appearances and is abstract in the sense that its subject matter is still general and hypothetical, just as the constructs of mathematics are. However, whereas the general hypothetical subject of mathematics and mathematical reasoning is any theoretical construct, for phenomenology the constructs are those of experience, considered in generalized terms.

In his discussion of phenomenology, Peirce divides all our experience into three general, universal categories and names them firstness, secondness, and thirdness. Peirce's categories are notoriously hard to understand. Indeed, Peirce thought it to be a science which we could only gain a hazy grasp of until we discovered the categories for ourselves in the course of our own experiences. The major problem with the categories, though, is that they are general and therefore difficult to explain in readily comprehensible terms. The best way to understand the categories, then, is to look at concrete examples that, in some way, exemplify firstness, secondness, or thirdness.

Peirce usually attempts to explain firstness, in general terms, as quality or feeling. It is perhaps more intuitive to grasp firstness this way: think of William James, Charles Peirce and Karl Marx; they all share the quality of being bearded. Let us abstract "beardedness" from this group of men and, when we consider that abstraction in and of itself, we are considering a firstness which those philosophers all share. Of course, the general concept of firstness is purer than this; "beardedness" is just an exemplification of it. Another example might come from Wittgenstein's discussion in the Philosophical Investigations of how we attend to shapes and colors of some objects. When I try to observe the shape of a vase, in separation from its color, size, etc., by squinting my eyes and tilting my head, I am attempting to observe a firstness of that object.

Resistance, existence or otherness, are all examples of secondness. Peirce often uses the scholastic concept of haecceity, or "thisness," to explain our experience of secondness. The idea is that when we experience some thing, we experience it as separate from other phenomena and as a brute thing of existence. It is this brute confrontational singularity that a thing experienced must have that Peirce thinks exemplifies secondness. It is our experience of an object as a thing separate to others within the universe that is an experience of secondness. A rather strange example might prove helpful in coming to understand what our experience of secondness might be like. Some historical commentaries of the first landings of the Spanish Conquistadors in South America report how the natives were in awe of these strange four-legged, two-armed, two headed God-like creatures. It seems that the Spanish rode ashore on horse back. Having never seen horses or white men before (let alone white men riding horses), the natives assumed that this was one creature. This seems like a rather strange case, but it perhaps provides a startling example of how we must re-organize our understanding when our experience fails to distinguish two instances of secondness. Of course, the minute the Conquistadors dismounted, the natives experienced the invader as separate to his horse, thereby experiencing his secondness.

Our experiences of mediation, intelligibility or understanding are examples of thirdness. When we place some experience within the structure of our understanding, when we assimilate an experience, we are experiencing thirdness. In many ways, thirdness is similar to the Hegelian notion of "synthesis" and captures the notions of development and growth. When we experience thirdness, we experience some sense of bringing phenomena into order with our knowledge. Principle exemplifiers of thirdness, then, are phenomena like laws, habits, conventions, reason, etc. Extending our previous example of the Conquistador, when the native saw him dismounted and experienced him as separate from his horse, he might also have come to understand that this stranger was, in fact, a man. This experience of understanding how this phenomenon fits into the world is, according to Peirce, meant to be an experience of thirdness.

The three categories are present in all experience but to differing degrees. Consequently, an experience of a quality like redness has firstness, secondness and thirdness; but it has firstness to a greater extent and so exemplifies that category. To see this, we should at least be clear that, as a quality, "redness" is a firstness just as "beardedness" is. However, our experience of the "redness" as existing means that it has secondness. Otherwise, we would be unable to experience it. And the fact that we are able to understand our experience of "redness" as just such an experience, means that it must also have an element of thirdness, otherwise we would be unable to assimilate that experience. So, our experience of "redness" has all three categories to some extent. However, the actual qualitative aspects of the experience, the very reason we call this an experience of "redness," are what predominate, and this is why we classify "redness" as a first, even though all of the categories are present to some extent.

Furthermore, despite the abstract nature of phenomenology, i.e., the hypothetical status of its constructs, it is not at odds with Peirce's scientific and experiential approach. As suggested earlier, Peirce maintains that phenomenology is something that we each must carry out and confirm for ourselves in our own experience. So, despite the initially abstract and theoretical appearance of phenomenology, it remains grounded in practice.

Finally, the universal categories are ever present in Peirce's work. In some respects, the categories are already present in the antecedent science of mathematics where Peirce describes them in terms of relations. The mathematical equivalent of firstness is one-place relational predicates like, "x is bearded"; of secondness is two-place relational predicates like, "x is the barber of y"; and of thirdness is three-place relational predicates like "x shaves y with z." The explanation of the categories in terms of relational predicates is an early attempt to explain firstness, secondness and thirdness on Peirce's part and as such should not be taken as reflecting upon the phenomenological account we are looking at here. It is, however, instructive to see one of Peirce's alternative attempts at explaining the universal categories. The phenomenological derivation of the categories that we are looking at here is a later development in Peirce's work, and reflects thought about categories that Peirce had always harbored, and is crucial to his systematic vision of philosophy.

b. The Normative Sciences

The normative sciences study the norms of worldly interaction. As Phenomenology studies the necessary qualities of experience, the normative sciences prescribe our response to those experiences. Further, there are three sub-areas within the normative sciences: aesthetics, ethics and logic. Aesthetics is the most abstract of the three normative sciences and provides foundational aims for the other prescriptive disciplines. Ethics explores these aims in relation to conduct, and logic explores those aims in relation to reasoning, a particular form of conduct.

i. Aesthetics and Ethics

Peirce's theories of aesthetics and ethics are not well developed. In many respects, Peirce self-consciously developed them for his system in order to provide foundations for logic. Consequently, his theories of aesthetics and ethics do not look too much like traditional theories. They are aesthetical and ethical in the sense of being theories of what is unconditionally admirable, and what is of value in human conduct, but they are not systematic or extensive. The two disciplines hold the usual hierarchical relations, with the super-ordinate science of aesthetics providing a general, guiding principle for its sub-ordinate science ethics, which in turn provides realized cases of that principle.

The only guiding principle from aesthetics to ethics that Peirce hints at is what he calls the "ultimate aesthetic ideal." The ultimate aesthetic ideal is, for Peirce, the growth of reason or rationality. He calls this the "growth of concrete reasonableness." For instance, the discovery that our galaxy is heliocentric and not geocentric marks a growth in concrete reasonableness, i.e., an increase in our grasp upon reality. Ethics, then, must take this general aesthetic ideal of the unconditionally admirable and ask, "What is admirable in the way of human conduct?" This makes ethics, for Peirce, a question of what kind of conduct is likely to see the growth of reason or rationality. The right action will take us towards achieving the aesthetic ideal, the wrong action will not.

Right conduct, then, is conduct that is self-controlled and deliberate. Further, it is self-controlled and deliberate in an attempt to achieve the aesthetic ideal. What is more, this self-controlled conduct is not simply about action for the individual in isolation; it is also about setting a precedent and providing an example for a community. For instance, I decide that I will never act without reflection upon rumors. I try, through self-controlled and deliberate response, to reflect upon the content and plausibility of the rumors I hear and to find out whether they are truthful or not. Only when I have done this do I act. Here is a case of adopting a particular kind of conduct with the aim of seeing the world become a more reasoned and rational place. However, when I die, my contribution to concrete reasonableness passes with me, unless I can spread this deliberate conduct further. This is precisely what Peirce thinks our ethical conduct should do; not by being purely about individual conduct, but by contributing habits, tendencies and general principles in conduct that others can see and adopt. Our contribution to achieving the aesthetic ideal, then, is not just the adoption of self-controlled conduct, but also establishing such conduct as a communal habit or convention. The growth of concrete reasonableness requires more than just action; it requires continued action.

Peirce has very little more to say about aesthetics and ethics. It appears the notions of the ultimate aesthetic ideal and what is unconditionally admirable in the way of human conduct are only interesting to Peirce as general guiding principles for the sub-ordinate discipline of logic.

ii. Logic

The third of the normative sciences, logic, takes the aim of aesthetics and the principles of ethics and applies them to reasoning. Logic, then, is self-controlled reasoning aimed at the growth of concrete reasonableness. It is as a form of conduct that logic takes a sub-ordinate position to ethics in the philosophical hierarchy.

Logic itself has three branches: Philosophical Grammar, Critical Logic and Methodeutic. Philosophical Grammar, often called Speculative Grammar, is a theoretical explanation and exploration of the nature of signs. This is the area within the hierarchy for Peirce's famous theory of Semiotics. It is located within logic conceived as the self-controlled conduct of reasoning because Peirce takes all thought, and so all reasoning, to occur through the use of signs. Philosophical Grammar, then, studies the nature of the basic phenomena of reasoning: signs. Signs are essentially triadic phenomena on Peirce's account, consisting of a sign vehicle, an object and an interpretant or interpreting thought which takes the sign to stand for its object. For instance, a fever is a sign of illness, which I understand as requiring treatment with medicine. The fever is the sign, the illness is its object, and my understanding of this connection is the interpretant. Peirce continually developed complex classifications for signs depending on the inter-relation between the sign, the object and the interpretant.

In many ways, we can see the sign as a concrete case of a general principle from phenomenology, which tells us that each experience will have firstness, secondness and thirdness. Indeed, Peirce sees the sign-vehicle as a firstness, the object as a secondness and the interpretant as a thirdness. However, after 1903, Peirce did not press this reflection of the phenomenological categories in his semiotic too far, even though he remained convinced that it existed.

The second branch of logic is Critical Logic, which studies types of argument. However, Peirce discusses more than just deductive arguments or reasoning within this branch of logic. He also includes discussion of inductive and abductive reasoning. Inductive reasoning, for Peirce, is quantitative reasoning and bears close resemblance to statistical analysis. On Peirce's analysis, induction is reasoning or argument to a general rule for a population based upon a sample from it. For instance, my sample of the metals in coins leads me to conclude that the pennies in current circulation have approximately 30% copper content. I have induced a general rule about the copper content of all pennies from a random sample of, say, 5% of the pennies in circulation. The more sampling I do the more accurate my general rule will become.

Abductive reasoning is similar to the inference to best explanation and provides conjectures for general rules by proffering some explanatory hypothesis based on some phenomena that we already know. A quick and simple way to grasp how Peirce thinks that abduction and induction are argument forms is to look at their structure in relation to the standard deductive syllogism. Consider the deductively valid argument: all felines are furry; all lions are felines; so all lions are furry. We can recast this to reflect the inductive form of argument like this: all lions are furry; all lions are felines; so all felines are furry. This is obviously a probabilistic argument based on sampling from a general population. We take what we know of some sample population - in this case, that lions as a sample of the general feline population are furry - and conclude that this is present in the population as a whole.

Again, we can recast the structure of the deductive argument to reflect abductive reasoning like this: all felines are furry; all lions are furry; so all lions are felines. Here we are taking two phenomena, the furriness of felines and the furriness of lions, and providing a conjecture that attempts to explain both phenomena with a single general rule.

Obviously, neither induction nor abduction are deductively valid, but Peirce still considers them to be important forms of reasoning and devotes discussion to them within the Critical Logic. Critical Logic also explains, through a discussion of how these arguments are useful, what counts as good or bad reasoning. Consequently, it further explains the purpose of the normative discipline of logic considered as a form of self-controlled conduct.

The third branch of logic is Methodeutic. Methodeutic is home to Peirce's theories of truth and inquiry and his pragmatic maxim. It concerns the use of signs and argument to create habits and forms of conduct conducive to achieving the logical take on the aesthetic ideal, a steady state of doubt resistant beliefs. For Peirce, the aim of logic or reasoning is to achieve a settled state of belief. The growth of this steady state comes from our desire to eradicate doubt, which causes considerable consternation according to Peirce. Whenever we encounter some phenomenon that casts doubt upon a belief of ours, we feel compelled to find the cause of the recalcitrant experience and settle our beliefs once more. This leads to a steady growth in our body of recalcitrant proof beliefs. Methodeutic, then, is the study of inquiry: or growth through reasoning in action.

c. Metaphysics

The final branch of philosophy is Metaphysics, the study of what is real. As phenomenology studies the necessary qualities of our experience, and the normative sciences prescribe our response to them, Metaphysics studies whether or not the objects of experience are real.

The first thing to note about Peirce's metaphysics is that it is still a distinctly "hands on" affair. Peirce's metaphysics, commonly labeled "scientific metaphysics," attempts to explain the reality of the phenomenological categories and of the methods and principles of inquiry as expounded in the normative sciences. This is all in contra-distinction to "Ontological Metaphysics," or metaphysics conducted by a priori reasoning. Peirce's pragmatism means that he is at odds with this kind of metaphysical endeavor. Since a concept's meaning relies upon its practical bearings, and the bulk of a priori metaphysics make no difference to practice or experience, the bulk of a priori metaphysics is meaningless. Again, this is similar to the verificationist's anti-metaphysical arguments, but where the logical positivists take this to mean the death of metaphysics, Peirce takes this to mean that a worthwhile metaphysics must be scientific, fallible, cautiously approached, and sub-ordinate to logic.

As with the normative sciences, Peirce makes various distinctions within the branch of metaphysics. Most interesting are his discussions of the reality of his phenomenological categories of firstness, secondness and thirdness and his evolutionary cosmology. In his discussion of the reality of the phenomenological categories, Peirce returns to the subject of his first philosophical discipline, phenomenology, where he identifies the three categories of firstness, secondness and thirdness as general features of all experience. Here, in his metaphysical work, Peirce turns his discussion to the reality of these phenomenological categories. His concern is to ask whether all or any of those categories are real independently of you or I. Does thirdness, for instance, really exist? If it does, then, on Peirce's view, "possibles" exist.

Peirce places himself with Aristotle, Kant and the Scottish Common-sense philosopher Thomas Reid in taking all three of the phenomenological categories to be real. However, since he takes his own "three category realism" to most strongly reflect the work of John Duns Scotus, Peirce labels himself a "scholastic realist." Peirce also characterizes other theories and philosophers depending on their own commitments to the reality of the phenomenological categories. For instance, in Peirce's opinion, "nominalism" does not take the category of thirdness to be real. Although the term "nominalism" is more normally part of mediaeval debate on the existence (or not) of universals, Peirce uses the term to refer to any theory that seems too hardheadedly committed to the explanation of phenomena in terms of concrete existent particulars. It is for this reason that Peirce labels as nominalist any theory which does not take the real existence of laws, generalities, possibilities, etc. seriously (i.e. is not committed to the existence of thirds or thirdness). Of course, it is possible, in Peirce's opinion, to move too far in the opposite direction. According to Peirce, Hegel's philosophy, for instance, places too much emphasis on thirdness at the expense of the other categories. Peirce's, own commitment to a three-category realism, though, is the source of the acute anti-nominalism which affects much of his other philosophical work.

Peirce's cosmological metaphysics is perhaps the most interesting of his metaphysical writings. Where his general metaphysics discusses the reality of the phenomenological categories, his cosmological work studies the reality and relation to the universe of his work in the normative sciences. The cosmological metaphysics looks at the aesthetic ideal (the growth of concrete reasonableness) and its attainment through growth and habit in the universe at large. In Peirce's cosmology, the universe grows from a state of nothingness to chaos, or all pervasive firstness. From the state of chaos, it develops to a state in which time and space exist, or a state of secondness, and from there to a state where it is governed by habit and law, i.e. a state of thirdness. The universe does this, not in a mechanistic or deterministic way, but by tending towards habit and a law-like nature through chance and spontaneous transition. This chance-like transition towards thirdness is the growth of concrete reasonableness, i.e. the attainment of the aesthetic ideal through the spontaneous development of habit.

Peirce's evolutionary cosmology has left many commentators uneasy about its relation to the rest of his work. His development of it during his own life time led some of his friends to fear for his sanity. Indeed, Peirce's turn towards cosmological metaphysics is often attributed to a mystical experience and crisis of faith in the 1890's. In truth, Peirce takes his cosmological work to be the logical upshot of the normative sciences and logic, which show the nature and desirability of the growth of reason. Cosmological metaphysics merely shows how the growth of concrete reasonableness occurs in the universe at large.

4. The Importance of the Systematic Interpretation

Traditionally, the systematic background to Peirce's theories of, say, pragmatism, inquiry, or the categories is ignored. This has lead to a failure to appreciate its significance to the detail of individual theories. Instead, the assessment of Peirce's philosophy is often made on an issue by issue basis. Take, for instance, Peirce's pragmatism. Its relation to the broader system enables Peirce to state his pragmatism and show how it need not lapse into nominalism, which is generally the outcome of pragmatic or verificationist principles. Understanding Peirce's devout anti-nominalism requires some grasp of his system and the place of the pragmatic maxim within it.

This, of course, is not to say that Peirce's philosophy must live and die by the systematic view. It is possible to take Peirce's views on individual topics and find much of value in them. However, interpreting Peirce's philosophy without any appreciation of the systematic background faces the danger of making serious mistakes about the import and intent of Peirce's work. Returning again to the Peirce's account of pragmatism, without the systematic background to provide some sense of Peirce's commitment to anti-nominalism and belief in the possibility of a scientific metaphysics, his pragmatism looks like a simple forerunner of the Logical Positivist's verification principle. Although common, such an interpretation fails to reflect the nuances of Peirce theory. Reaching a full understanding of Peirce's work on individual topics, then, is always best achieved with an eye on the systematic background.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Peirce, C.S. 1931-58. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1-6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7-8). (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press).
    • The first widespread presentation of Peirce's work both published and unpublished; its topical arrangement makes it misleading but it is still the first source for most people.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1982-. The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, eds. M. Fisch, C. Kloesel, E. Moore, N. Houser et al. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The ongoing vision of the late Max Fisch and colleagues to produce an extensive presentation of Peirce's views on a par with The Collected Papers, but without its idiosyncrasies. Currently published in eight volumes (of thirty) up to 1884, it is rapidly superseding its predecessor.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1992-94. The Essential Peirce, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Vol. 1) and the Peirce Edition Project (Vol. 2). (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • A crucial two volume reader of the cornerstone works of Peirce's writings. Equally important are the introductory commentaries, particularly by Nathan Houser in Volume 1.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Anderson, D. 1995. The Strands of System. (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue University Press).
    • A systematic reading of Peirce's thought which, in its introduction, makes an in-depth breakdown of the elements of the system and their relation to each other. Its main body reproduces two important papers by Peirce with accompanying commentary.
  • Hookway, C.J. 1985. Peirce. (London: Routledge and Kegan Paul).
    • Important treatment of Peirce as a systematic philosopher but with emphasis on Peirce's Kantian inheritance and later rejection of the transcendental approach to truth, logic and inquiry.

Author Information:

Albert Atkin
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom

Classical Theory of Concepts, The

The Classical Theory of Concepts

The classical theory of concepts is one of the five primary theories of concepts, the other four being prototype or exemplar theories, atomistic theories, theory-theories, and neoclassical theories. The classical theory implies that every complex concept has a classical analysis, where a classical analysis of a concept is a proposition giving metaphysically necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for being in the extension across possible worlds for that concept. That is, a classical analysis for a complex concept C gives a set of individually necessary conditions for being a C (or conditions that must be satisfied in order to be a C) that together are sufficient for being a C (or are such that something’s satisfying every member of that set of necessary conditions entails its being a C). The classical view also goes by the name of “the definitional view of concepts,” or “definitionism,” where a definition of a concept is given in terms of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions.

This article provides information on the classical theory of concepts as present in the historical tradition, on concepts construed most generally, on the nature of classical conceptual analysis, and on the most significant of the objections raised against the classical view.

Table of Contents

  1. Historical Background and Advantages of the Classical View
  2. Concepts in General
    1. Concepts as Semantic Values
    2. Concepts as Universals
    3. Concepts as Mind-Dependent or Mind-Independent
    4. Concepts as the Targets of Analysis
    5. The Classical View and Concepts in General
  3. Classical Analyses
    1. Necessary and Sufficient Conditions
    2. Logical Constitution
    3. Other Conditions on Classical Analyses
    4. Testing Candidate Analyses
    5. Apriority and Analyticity with respect to Classical Analyses
  4. Objections to the Classical View
    1. Plato’s Problem
    2. The Argument from Categorization
    3. Arguments from Vagueness
    4. Quine’s Criticisms
    5. Scientific Essentialist Criticisms
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Historical Background and Advantages of the Classical View

The classical view can be traced back to at least the time of Socrates, for in many of Plato’s dialogues Socrates is clearly seeking a classical analysis of some notion or other. In the Euthyphro, for instance, Socrates seeks to know the nature of piety: Yet what he seeks is not given in terms of, for example, a list of pious people or actions, nor is piety to be identified with what the gods love. Instead, Socrates seeks an account of piety in terms of some specification of what is shared by all things pious, or what makes pious things pious—that is, he seeks a specification of the essence of piety itself. The Socratic elenchus is a method of finding out the nature or essence of various kinds of things, such as friendship (discussed in the Lysis), courage (the Laches), knowledge (the Theatetus), and justice (the Republic). That method of considering candidate definitions and seeking counterexamples to them is the same method one uses to test candidate analyses by seeking possible counterexamples to them, and thus Socrates is in effect committed to something very much like the classical view of concepts.

One sees the same sort of commitment throughout much of the Western tradition in philosophy from the ancient Greeks through the present. Clear examples include Aristotle’s notion of a definition as “an account [or logos] that signifies the essence” (Topics I) by way of a specification of essential attributes, as well as his account of definitions for natural kinds in terms of genus and difference. Particular examples of classical-style analyses abound after Aristotle: For instance, Descartes (in Meditation VI) defines body as that which is extended in both space and time, and mind as that which thinks. Locke (in the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Ch. 21) defines being free with respect to doing an action A as choosing/willing to do A where one’s choice is part of the cause of one’s actually doing A. Hume defines a miracle (in Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, §X) as an event that is both a violation of the laws of nature and caused by God. And so on. The classical view looks to be a presumption of the early analytic philosophers as well (with Wittgenstein being a notable exception). The classical view is present in the writings of Frege and Russell, and the view receives its most explicit treatment by that time in G.E. Moore’s Lectures on Philosophy and other writings. Moore gives a classical analysis of the very notion of a classical analysis, and from then on the classical view (or some qualified version of it) has been one of the pillars of analytic philosophy itself.

One reason the classical view has had such staying power is that it provides the most obvious grounding for the sort of inquiry within philosophy that Socrates began. If one presumes that there are answers to What is F?-type questions, where such questions ask for the nature of knowledge, mind, goodness, etc., then that entails that there is such a thing as the nature of knowledge, mind, goodness, etc. The nature of knowledge, for example, is that which is shared by all cases of knowledge, and a classical analysis of the concept of knowledge specifies the nature of knowledge itself. So the classical view fits neatly with the reasonable presumption that there are legitimate answers to philosophical questions concerning the natures or essences of things. As at least some other views of concepts reject the notion that concepts have metaphysically necessary conditions, accepting such other views is tantamount to rejecting (or at least significantly revising) the legitimacy of an important part of the philosophical enterprise.

The classical view also serves as the ground for one of the most basic tools of philosophy—the critical evaluation of arguments. For instance, one ground of contention in the abortion debate concerns whether fetuses have the status of moral persons or not. If they do, then since moral persons have the right not to be killed, generally speaking, then it would seem to follow that abortion is immoral. The classical view grounds the natural way to address the main contention here, for part of the task at hand is to find a proper analysis of the concept of being a moral person. If that analysis specifies features such that not all of them are had by fetuses, then fetuses are not moral persons, and the argument against the moral permissibility of abortion fails. But without there being analyses of the sort postulated by the classical view, it is far from clear how such critical analysis of philosophical arguments is to proceed. So again, the classical view seems to underpin an activity crucial to the practice of philosophy itself.

In contemporary philosophy, J. J. Katz (1999), Frank Jackson (1994, 1998), and Christopher Peacocke (1992) are representative of those who hold at least some qualified version of the classical view. There are others as well, though many philosophers have rejected the view (at least in part due to the criticisms to be discussed in section 4 below). The view is almost universally rejected in contemporary psychology and cognitive science, due to both theoretical difficulties with the classical view and the arrival of new theories of concepts over the last quarter of the twentieth century.

2. Concepts in General

The issue of the nature of concepts is important in philosophy generally, but most perspicuously in philosophy of language and philosophy of mind. Most generally, concepts are thought to be among those things that count as semantic values or meanings (along with propositions). There is also reason to think that concepts are universals (along with properties, relations, etc.), and what general theory of universals applies to concepts is thus a significant issue with respect to the nature of concepts. Whether concepts are mind-dependent or mind-independent is another such issue. Finally, concepts tend to be construed as the targets of analysis. If one then treats analysis as classical analysis, and holds that all complex concepts have classical analyses, then one accepts the classical view. Other views of concepts might accept the thesis that concepts are targets of analysis, but differ from the classical view over the sort of analysis that all complex concepts have.

a. Concepts as Semantic Values

As semantic values, concepts are the intensions or meanings of sub-sentential verbal expressions such as predicates, adjectives, verbs, and adverbs. Just as the sentence “The sun is a star” expresses the proposition that the sun is a star, the predicate “is a star” expresses the concept of being a star (or [star], to introduce notation to be used in what follows). Further, just as the English sentence “Snow is white” expresses the proposition that snow is white, and so does the German sentence “Schnee ist Weiss,” the predicates “is white” in English and “ist Weiss” in German both express the same concept, the concept of being white (or [white]). The intension or meaning of a sentence is a proposition. The intensions or meanings of many sub-sentential entities are concepts.

b. Concepts as Universals

Concepts are also generally thought to be universals. The reasons for this are threefold:

(1) A given concept is expressible using distinct verbal expressions. This can occur in several different ways. My uttering “Snow is white” and your uttering “Snow is white” are distinct utterances, and their predicates are distinct expressions of the same concept [white]. My uttering “Snow is white” and your uttering “Schnee ist Weiss” are distinct sentences with their respective predicates expressing the same concept ([white], again). Even within the same language, my uttering “Grisham is the author of The Firm” and your uttering “Grisham is The Firm’s author” are distinct sentences with distinct predicates, yet their respective predicates express the same concept (the concept [the author of The Firm], in this case).

(2) Second, different agents can possess, grasp, or understand the same concept, though such possession might come in degrees. Most English speakers possess the concept [white], and while many possess [neutrino], not many possess that concept to such a degree that one knows a great deal about what neutrinos themselves are.

(3) Finally, concepts typically have multiple exemplifications or instantiations. Many distinct things are white, and thus there are many exemplifications or instances of the concept [white]. There are many stars and many neutrinos, and thus there are many instances of [star] and [neutrino]. Moreover, distinct concepts can have the very same instances. The concepts [renate] and [cardiate] have all the same actual instances, as far as we know, and so does [human] and [rational animal]. Distinct concepts can also have necessarily all of the same instances: For instance, the concepts [triangular figure] and [trilateral figure] must have the same instances, yet the predicates “is a triangular figure” and “is a trilateral figure” seem to have different meanings.

As universals, concepts may be treated under any of the traditional accounts of universals in general. Realism about concepts (considered as universals) is the view that concepts are distinct from their instances, and nominalism is the view that concepts are nothing over and above, or distinct from, their instances. Ante rem realism (or platonism) about concepts is the view that concepts are ontologically prior to their instances—that is, concepts exist whether they have instances or not. In re realism about concepts is the view that concepts are in some sense “in” their instances, and thus are not ontologically prior to their instances. Conceptualism with respect to concepts holds that concepts are mental entities, being either immanent in the mind itself as a sort of idea, as constituents of complete thoughts, or somehow dependent on the mind for their existence (perhaps by being possessed by an agent or by being possessible by an agent). Conceptualist views also include imagism, the view (dating from Locke and others) that concepts are a sort of mental image. Finally, nominalist views of concepts might identify concepts with classes or sets of particular things (with the concept [star] being identified with the set of all stars, or perhaps the set of all possible stars). Linguistic nominalism identifies concepts with the linguistic expressions used to express them (with [star] being identified with the predicate “is a star,” perhaps). Type linguistic nominalism identifies concepts with types of verbal expressions (with [star] identified with the type of verbal expression exemplified by the predicate “is a star”).

c. Concepts as Mind-Dependent or Mind-Independent

On many views, concepts are things that are “in” the mind, or “part of” the mind, or at least are dependent for their existence on the mind in some sense. Other views deny such claims, holding instead that concepts are mind-independent entities. Conceptualist views are examples of the former, and platonic views are examples of the latter. The issue of whether concepts are mind-dependent or mind-independent carries great weight with respect to the clash between the classical view and other views of concepts (such as prototype views and theory-theories). If concepts are immanent in the mind as mental particulars, for instance, then various objections to the classical view have more force; if concepts exist independently of one’s ideas, beliefs, capacities for categorizing objects, etc., then some objections to the classical view have much less force.

d. Concepts as the Targets of Analysis

Conceptual analysis is of concepts, and philosophical questions of the form What is F? (such as “What is knowledge?,” “What is justice?,” “What is a person?,” etc.) are questions calling for conceptual analyses of various concepts (such as [knowledge], [justice], [person], etc.). Answering the further question “What is a conceptual analysis?” is yet another way to distinguish among different views of concepts. For instance, the classical view holds that all complex concepts have classical analyses, where a complex concept is a concept having an analysis in terms of other concepts. Alternatively, prototype views analyze concepts in terms of typical features or in terms of a prototypical or exemplary case. For instance, such a view might analyze the concept of being a bird in terms of such typical features as being capable of flight, being small, etc., which most birds share, even if not all of them do. A second sort of prototype theory (sometimes called “the exemplar view”) might analyze the concept of being a bird in terms of a most exemplary case (a robin, say, for the concept of being a bird). So-called theory-theories analyze a concept in terms of some internally represented theory about the members of the extension of that concept. For example, one might have an overall theory of birds, and the concept one expresses with one’s use of ‘bird’ is then analyzed in terms of the role that concept plays in that internally represented theory. Neoclassical views of concepts preserve one element of the classical view, namely the claim that all complex concepts have metaphysically necessary conditions (in the sense that, for example, being unmarried is necessary for being a bachelor), but reject the claim that all complex concepts have metaphysically sufficient conditions. Finally, atomistic views reject all notions of analysis just mentioned, denying that concepts have analyses at all.

e. The Classical View and Concepts in General

The classical view claims simply that all complex concepts have classical analyses. As such, the classical view makes no claims as to the status of concepts as universals, or as being mind-dependent or mind-independent entities. The classical view also is consistent with concepts being analyzable by means of other forms of analysis. Yet some views of universals are more friendly to the classical view than others, and the issue of the mind-dependence or mind-independence of concepts is of some importance to whether the classical view is correct or not. For instance, if concepts are identical to ideas present in the mind (as would be true on some conceptualist views), then if the contents of those ideas fail to have necessary and sufficient defining conditions, then the classical view looks to be false (or at least not true for all concepts). Alternatively, on platonic views of concepts, such a lack of available necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for the contents of our own ideas is of no consequence to the classical view, since ideas are not concepts according to platonic accounts.

3. Classical Analyses

There are two components to an analysis of a complex concept (where a complex concept is a concept that has an analysis in terms of other “simpler” concepts): The analysandum, or the concept being analyzed, and the analysans, or the concept that “does the analyzing.” For a proposition to be a classical analysis, the following conditions must hold:

(I) A classical analysis must specify a set of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for being in the analysandum’s extension (where a concept’s extension is everything to which that concept could apply). (Other classical theorists deny that all classical analysis specify jointly sufficient conditions, holding instead that classical analyses merely specify necessary and sufficient conditions.)

(II) A classical analysis must specify a logical constitution of the analysandum.

Other suggested conditions on classical analysis are given below.

a. Necessary and Sufficient Conditions

Consider an arbitrary concept [F]. A necessary condition for being an F is a condition such that something must satisfy that condition in order for it to be an F. For instance, being male is necessary for being a bachelor, and being four-sided is necessary for being a square. Such characteristics specified in necessary conditions are shared by, or had in common with, all things to which the concept in question applies.

A sufficient condition for being an F is a condition such that if something satisfies that condition, then it must be an F. Being a bachelor is sufficient for being male, for instance, and being a square is sufficient for being a square.

A necessary and sufficient condition for being an F is a condition such that not only must a thing satisfy that condition in order to be an F, but it is also true that if a thing satisfies that condition, then it must be an F. For instance, being a four-sided regular, plane figure is both necessary and sufficient for being a square. That is, a thing must be a four-sided regular plane figure in order for it to be a square, and if a thing is a four-sided regular plane figure, then it must be a square. [The word "regular" means that all sides are the same length.]

Finally, for a concept [F], necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for being an F is a set of necessary conditions such that satisfying all of them is sufficient for being an F. The conditions of being four-sided and of being a regular figure are each necessary conditions for being a square, for instance, and the conjunction of them is a sufficient condition for being a square.

b. Logical Constitution

A classical analysis also gives a logical constitution of the concept being analyzed, in keeping with Moore’s idea that an analysis breaks a concept up into its components or constituents. In an analysis, it is the logical constituents that an analysis specifies, where a logical constituent of a concept is a concept entailed by that concept. (A concept entails another concept when being in the extension of the former entails being in the extension of the latter.) For instance, [four-sided] is a logical constituent of [square], since something’s being a square entails that it is four-sided.

For a logical constitution specified by a classical analysis, a logical constitution of a concept [F] is a collection of concepts, where each member of that collection is entailed by [F], and where [F] entails all of them taken collectively.

Most complex concepts will have more than one logical constitution, given that there are different ways of analyzing the same concept. For instance, “A square is a four-sided regular figure” expresses an analysis of [square], but so does “A square is a four-sided, closed plane figure having sides all the same length and having neighboring sides orthogonal to one another.” The first analysis gives one logical constitution for [square], and the second analysis seems to give another.

c. Other Conditions on Classical Analyses

In addition to conditions (I) and (II), other conditions on classical analyses have been proposed. Among them are the following:

(III) A classical analysis must not include the analysandum as either its analysans or as part of its analysans. That is, a classical analysis cannot be circular. “A square is a square” does not express an analysis, and neither does “A true sentence is a sentence that specifies a true correspondence between the proposition it expresses and the world.”

(IV) A classical analysis must not have its analysandum be more complex than its analysans. That is, while “A square is a four-sided regular figure” expresses an analysis, “A four-sided regular figure is a square” does not. While the latter sentence is true, it does not express an analysis of [four-sided regular figure]. The concept [four-sided regular figure] analyzes [square], not the other way around.

(V) A classical analysis specifies a precise extension of the concept being analyzed, in the sense of specifying for any possible particular whether it is definitely in or definitely not in that concept’s extension.

(VI) A classical analysis does not include any vague concepts in either its analysandum or its analysans.

The last two conditions concern vagueness. It might be thought that an analysis has to specify in some very precise way what is, and what is not, in that concept’s extension (condition (V)), and also that an expression of an analysis itself cannot include any vague terms (condition (VI)).

d. Testing Candidate Analyses

In seeking a correct analysis for a concept, one typically considers some number of so-called candidate analyses. A correct analysis will have no possible counterexamples, where such counterexamples might show a candidate analysis to be either too broad or too narrow. For instance, let

“A square is a four-sided, closed plane figure”

express a candidate analysis for the concept of being a square. This candidate analysis is too broad, since it would include some things as being squares that are nevertheless not squares. Counterexamples include any trapezoid or rectangle (that is not itself a square, that is).

On the other hand, the candidate analysis expressed by

“A square is a red four-sided regular figure”

is too narrow, as it rules out some genuine squares as being squares, as it is at least possible for there to be squares other than red ones. Assuming for sake of illustration that squares are the sorts of things that can be colored at all, a blue square counts as a counterexample to this candidate analysis, since it fails one of the stated conditions that a square be red.

It might be wondered as to why correct analyses have no possible counterexamples, instead of the less stringent condition that correct analyses have no actual counterexamples. The reason is that analyses are put forth as necessary truths. An analysis of a concept like the concept of being a mind, for instance, is a specification of what is shared by all possible minds, not just what is in common among those minds that actually happen to exist. Similarly, in seeking an analysis of the concept of justice or piety (as Socrates sought), what one seeks is not a specification of what is in common among all just actions or all pious actions that are actual. Instead, what one seeks is the nature of justice or piety, and that is what is in common among all possible just actions or pious actions.

e. Apriority and Analyticity with respect to Classical Analyses

Classical analyses are commonly thought to be both a priori and analytic. They look to be a priori since there is no empirical component essential to their justification, and in that sense classical analyses are knowable by reason alone. In fact, the method of seeking possible counterexamples to a candidate analysis is a paradigmatic case of justifying a proposition a priori. Classical analyses also appear to be analytic, since on the rough construal of analytic propositions as those propositions “true by meaning alone,” classical analyses are indeed that sort of proposition. For instance, “A square is a four-sided regular figure” expresses an analysis, and if “square” and “four-sided regular figure” are identical in meaning, then the analysis is true by meaning alone. On an account of analyticity where analytic propositions are those propositions where what is expressed by the predicate expression is “contained in” what is expressed in the subject expression, classical analyses turn out to be analytic. If what is expressed by “four-sided regular figure” is contained in what is expressed by “square,” then “A square is a four-sided regular figure” is such that the meaning of its predicate expression is contained in what its subject expresses. Finally, on an account of analyticity treating analytic propositions as those where substitution of codesignating terms yields a logical truth, classical analyses turn out to be analytic propositions once more. For since “square” and “four-sided regular figure” have the same possible-worlds extension, then substituting “square” for “four-sided regular figure” in “A square is a four-sided regular figure” yields “A square is a square,” which is a logical truth. (For a contrary view holding that analyses are synthetic propositions, rather than analytic, see Ackerman 1981, 1986, and 1992.)

4. Objections to the Classical View

Despite its history and natural appeal, in many circles the classical view has long since been rejected for one reason or another. Even in philosophy, many harbor at least some skepticism of the thesis that all complex concepts have classical analyses with the character described above. A much more common view is that some complex concepts follow the classical model, but not all of them. This section considers six fairly common objections to the classical view.

a. Plato’s Problem

Plato’s problem is that after over two and a half millennia of seeking analyses of various philosophically important concepts, few if any classical analyses of such concepts have ever been discovered and widely agreed upon as fact. If there are classical analyses for all complex concepts, the critics claim, then one would expect a much higher rate of success in finding such analyses given the effort expended so far. In fact, aside from ordinary concepts such as [bachelor] and [sister], along with some concepts in logic and mathematics, there seems to be no consensus on analyses for any philosophically significant concepts. Socrates’ question “What is justice?,” for instance, has received a monumental amount of attention since Socrates’ time, and while there has been a great deal of progress made with respect to what is involved in the nature of justice, there still is not a consensus view as to an analysis of the concept of justice. The case is similar with respect to questions such as “What is the mind?,” “What is knowledge?,” “What is truth?,” “What is freedom?,” and so on.

One might think that such an objection holds the classical view to too high a standard. After all, even in the sciences there is rarely universal agreement with respect to a particular scientific theory, and progress is ongoing in furthering our understanding of entities such as electrons and neutrinos, as well as events like the Big Bang—there is always more to be discovered. Yet it would be preposterous to think that the scientific method is flawed in some way simply because such investigations are ongoing, and because there is not universal agreement with respect to various theories in the sciences. So why think that the method of philosophical analysis, with its presumption that all complex concepts have classical analyses, is flawed in some way because of the lack of widespread agreement with respect to completed or full analyses of philosophically significant concepts?

Yet while there are disagreements in the sciences, especially in cases where a given scientific theory is freshly proposed, such disagreements are not nearly as common as they are in philosophy. For instance, while there are practicing scientists that claim to be suspicious of quantum mechanics, of the general theory of relativity, or of evolution, such detractors are extremely rare compared to what is nearly a unanimous opinion that those theories are correct or nearly correct. In philosophy, however, there are widespread disagreements concerning even the most basic questions in philosophy. For instance, take the questions “Are we free?” and “Does being free require somehow being able to do otherwise?” The first question asks for an analysis of what is meant by “free,” and the second asks whether being able to do otherwise is a necessary condition on being free. Much attention has been paid to such basic questions, and the critics of the classical view claim that one would expect some sort of consensus as to the answers to them if the concept of freedom really has a classical analysis. So there is not mere disagreement with respect to the answers to such questions, but such disagreements are both widespread and involve quite fundamental issues as well. As a result, the difficulty in finding classical analyses has led many to reject the classical view.

b. The Argument from Categorization

There are empirical objections to the classical view as well. The argument from categorization takes as evidence various data with respect to our sorting or categorizing things into various categories, and infers that such behavior shows that the classical view is false. The evidence shows that we tend not to use any set of necessary and sufficient conditions to sort things in to one category or another, where such sorting behavior is construed as involving the application of various concepts. It is not as if one uses a classical analysis to sort things into the bird category, for instance. Instead, it seems that things are categorized according to typical features of members of the category in question, and the reason for this is that more typical members of a given category are sorted into that category more quickly than less typical members of that same category. Robins are sorted into the bird category more quickly than eagles, for instance, and eagles are sorted into the bird category more quickly than ostriches. What this suggests is that if concepts are used for acts of categorization, and classical analyses are not used in all such categorization tasks, then the classical view is false.

One presumption of the argument is that when one sorts something into one category or another, one uses one’s understanding of a conceptual analysis to accomplish the task. Yet classical theorists might complain that this need not be the case. One might use a set of typical features to sort things into the bird category, even if there is some analysis not in terms of typical features that gives the essential features shared by all birds. In other words (as Rey (1983) points out), there is a difference between what it is to look like a bird and what it is to be a bird. An analysis of a concept gives the conditions on which something is an instance of that concept, and it would seem that a concept can have an analysis (classical or otherwise) even if agents use some other set of conditions in acts of categorization.

Whether this reply to the argument from categorization rebuts the argument remains to be seen, but many researchers in cognitive psychology have taken the empirical evidence from acts of categorization to be strong evidence against the classical view. For such evidence also serves as evidence in favor of a view of concepts in competition with the classical view: the so-called prototype view of concepts. According to the prototype view, concepts are analyzed not in terms of necessary and jointly sufficient conditions, but in terms of lists of typical features. Such typical features are not shared by all instances of a given concept, but are shared by at least most of them. For instance, a typical bird flies, is relatively small, and is not carnivorous. Yet none of these features is shared by all birds. Penguins don’t fly, albatrosses are quite large, and birds of prey are carnivores. Such a view of concepts fits much more neatly with the evidence concerning our acts of categorization, so such critics reject the classical view.

c. Arguments from Vagueness

Vagueness has also been seen as problematic for the classical view. For one might think that in virtue of specifying necessary and jointly sufficient conditions, a classical analysis thus specifies a precise extension for the concept being analyzed (where a concept C has a precise extension if and only if for all x, x is either definitely in the extension of C or definitely not in the extension of C). Yet most complex concepts seem not to have such precise extensions. Terms like “bald,” “short,” and “old” all seem to have cases where it is unclear whether the term applies or not. That is, it seems that the concepts expressed by those terms are such that their extensions are unclear. For instance, it seems that there is no precise boundary between the bald and the non-bald, the short and the non-short, and the old and the non-old. But if there are no such precise boundaries to the extensions for many concepts, and a classical analysis specifies such precise boundaries, then there cannot be classical analyses for what is expressed by vague terms.

Two responses deserve note. One reply on behalf of the classical view is that vagueness is not part of the world itself, but instead is a matter of our own epistemic shortcomings. We find unclear cases simply because we don’t know where the precise boundaries for various concepts lie. There could very well be a precise boundary between the bald and the non-bald, for instance, but we find “bald” to be vague simply because we do not know where that boundary lies. Such an epistemic view of vagueness would seem to be of assistance to the classical view, though such a view of vagueness needs a defense, particularly given the presence of other plausible views of vagueness. The second response is that one might admit the presence of unclear cases, and admit the presence of vagueness or “fuzziness” as a feature of the world itself, but hold that such fuzziness is mirrored in the analyses of the concepts expressed by vague terms. For instance, the concept of being a black cat might be analyzed in terms of [black] and [cat], even if “black” and “cat” are both vague terms. So classical theorists might reply that if the vagueness of a term can be mirrored in an analysis in such a way, then the classical view can escape the criticisms.

d. Quine’s Criticisms

A family of criticisms of the classical view is based on W.V.O. Quine’s (1953/1999, 1960) extensive attack on analyticity and the analytic/synthetic distinction. According to Quine, there is no philosophically clear account of the distinction between analytic and synthetic propositions, and as such there is either no such distinction at all or it does no useful philosophical work. Yet classical analyses would seem to be paradigmatic cases of analytic propositions (for example, [bachelors are unmarried males], [a square is a four-sided regular figure]), and if there are no analytic propositions then it seems there are no classical analyses. Furthermore, if there is no philosophically defensible distinction between analytic and synthetic propositions, then there is no legitimate criterion by which to delineate analyses from non-analyses. Those who hold that analyses are actually synthetic propositions face the same difficulty. If analyses are synthetic, then one still needs a principled difference between analytic and synthetic propositions in order to distinguish between analyses and non-analyses.

The literature on Quine’s arguments is vast, and suffice it to say that criticism of Quine’s arguments and of his general position is widespread as well. Yet even among those philosophers who reject Quine’s arguments, most admit that there remains a great deal of murkiness concerning the analytic/synthetic distinction, despite its philosophical usefulness. With respect to the classical view of concepts, the options available to classical theorists are at least threefold: Either meet Quine’s arguments in a satisfactory way, reject the notion that all analyses are analytic (or that all are synthetic), or characterize classical analysis in a way that is neutral with respect to the analytic/synthetic distinction.

e. Scientific Essentialist Criticisms

Scientific essentialism is the view that the members of natural kinds (like gold, tiger, and water) have essential properties at the microphysical level of description, and that identity statements between natural kind terms and descriptions of such properties are metaphysically necessary and knowable only a posteriori. Some versions of scientific essentialism include the thesis that such identity statements are synthetic. That such statements are a posteriori and synthetic looks to be problematic for the classical view. For sake of illustration, let “Water is H2O” express an analysis of what is meant by the natural kind term “water.” According to scientific essentialism, such a proposition is metaphysically necessary in that it is true in all possible worlds, but it is a necessary truth discovered via empirical science. As such, it is not discovered by the a priori process of seeking possible counterexamples, revising candidate analyses in light of such counterexamples, and so on. But if water’s being H2O is known a posteriori, this runs counter to the usual position that all classical analyses are a priori. Furthermore, given that what is expressed by “Water is H2O” is a posteriori, this entails that it is synthetic, rather than analytic as the classical view would normally claim.

Again, the literature is vast with respect to scientific essentialism, identity statements involving natural kind terms, and the epistemic and modal status of such statements. For classical theorists, short of denying the basic theses of scientific essentialism, some options that save some portion of the classical view include holding that the classical view holds for some concepts (such as those in logic and mathematics) but not others (such as those expressed by natural kind terms), or characterizing classical analysis in a way that is neutral with respect to the analytic/synthetic distinction. How successful such strategies would be remains to be seen, and such a revised classical view would have to be weighed against other theories of concepts that handle all complex concepts with a unified treatment.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Ackerman, D. F. 1981. “The Informativeness of Philosophical Analysis.” In P. French, et al. (Eds.), Midwest Studies in Philosophy, vol. 6. Minneapolis, Minnesota: University of Minnesota Press, 313-320.
  • Ackerman, D. F. 1986. “Essential Properties and Philosophical Analysis.” In P. French, et al. (Eds.), Midwest Studies in Philosophy, vol. 11. Minneapolis, Minnesota: University of Minnesota Press, 304-313.
  • Ackerman, D. F. 1992. “Analysis and Its Paradoxes.” In E. Ullman-Margalit (Ed.), The Scientific Enterprise: The Israel Colloquium Studies in History, Philosophy, and Sociology of Science, vol. 4. Norwell, Massachusetts: Kluwer.
  • Bealer, George. 1982. Quality and Concept. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bealer, George. 1996. “A Priori Knowledge and the Scope of Philosophy.” Philosophical Studies 81, 121-142.
  • Bonjour, Laurence. 1998. In Defense of Pure Reason: A Rationalist Account of A Priori Justification. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chalmers, David J. and Jackson, Frank. 2001. “Conceptual Analysis and Reductive Explanation” [On-line]. Available:
  • Donnellan, Keith. 1983. “Kripke and Putnam on Natural Kind Terms.” In C. Ginet and S. Shoemaker (Eds.), Knowledge and Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 84-104.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. 1998. Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Fodor, Jerry A., Garrett, M. F., Walker, E. C. T., and Parkes, C. H. 1980/1999. “Against Definitions.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 491-512.
  • Grice, H. P. and Strawson, P. F. 1956. “In Defense of a Dogma.” The Philosophical Review 65 (2), 141-158.
  • Hanna, Robert. 1998. “A Kantian Critique of Scientific Essentialism.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 58 (3), 497-528.
  • Harman, Gilbert. 1999. “Doubts About Conceptual Analysis.” In Gilbert Harman, Reasoning, Meaning, and Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 138-143.
  • Jackson, Frank. 1994. “Armchair Metaphysics.” In M. Michael and J. O’Leary-Hawthorne (Eds.), Philosophy in Mind. Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Jackson, Frank. 1998. From Metaphysics to Ethics: A Defence of Conceptual Analysis. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Katz, J. J. 1999.
  • Keefe, Rosanna and Smith, Peter (Eds.). 1999. Vagueness: A Reader. Cambridge, Massachusetts: M.I.T. Press.
  • King, Jeffrey C. 1998. “What is a Philosophical Analysis?” Philosophical Studies 90, 155-179.
  • Kripke, Saul A. 1980. Naming and Necessity. Cambridge, Massachusetts: Harvard University Press.
  • Kripke, Saul A. 1993. “Identity and Necessity.” In A. W. Moore, Meaning and Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 162-191.
  • Langford, C. H. 1968. “The Notion of Analysis in Moore’s Philosophy.” In Schlipp 1968, 321-342.
  • Laurence, Stephen and Margolis, Eric. 1999. “Concepts and Cognitive Science.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 3-81.
  • Margolis, Eric and Laurence, Stephen (Eds.). 1999. Concepts: Core Readings. M.I.T. Press.
  • Moore, G. E. 1966. Lectures on Philosophy. Ed. C. Lewy. London: Humanities Press.
  • Moore, G. E. 1968. “A Reply to My Critics.” In Schlipp 1968, 660-677.
  • Murphy, Gregory L. 2002. The Big Book of Concepts. Cambridge: M.I.T. Press.
  • Peacocke, Christopher. 1992. A Study of Concepts. Cambridge: M.I.T. Press.
  • Pitt, David. 1999. “In Defense of Definitions.” Philosophical Psychology 12 (2), 139-156.
  • Plato. 1961a. The Collected Dialogues of Plato. Ed. Edith Hamilton and Huntington Cairns. Princeton, New Jersey: Princeton University Press.
  • Plato. 1961b. Euthyphro. Trans. L. Cooper. In Plato 1961a, 169-185.
  • Plato. 1961c. Laches. Trans. L. Cooper. In Plato 1961a, 123-144.
  • Plato. 1961d. Lysis. Trans. L. Cooper. In Plato 1961a, 145-168.
  • Plato. 1961e. Theatetus. Trans. L. Cooper. In Plato 1961a, 845-919.
  • Plato. 1992. Republic. Trans. G. M. A. Grube. Indianapolis, Indiana: Hackett.
  • Prinz, Jesse J. 2002. Furnishing the Mind: Concepts and Their Perceptual Basis. Cambridge: M.I.T. Press.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1962. “It Ain’t Necessarily So.” Journal of Philosophy 59 (22), 658-671.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1966. “The Analytic and the Synthetic.” In H. Feigl and G. Maxwell, eds., Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. III. Minneapolis, Minnesota: University of Minnesota Press, 358-397. Putnam,
  • Hilary. 1970. “Is Semantics Possible?” In H. Keifer and M. Munitz, eds., Language, Belief, and Metaphysics. New York: State University of New York Press, 50-63.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1975. “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’.” In Keith Gunderson (Ed.), Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. VII. Minneapolis, Minnesota: University of Minnesota Press, 131-193.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1983. “‘Two Dogmas’ Revisited.” In Hilary Putnam, Realism and Reason: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 87-97.
  • Putnam, Hilary. 1990. “Is Water Necessarily H2O?” In James Conant (Ed.), Realism with a Human Face. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 54-79.
  • Quine, W. V. O. 1953/1999. “Two Dogmas of Empiricism.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 153-170.
  • Quine, W. V. O. 1960. Word and Object. Cambridge: The M.I.T. Press.
  • Ramsey, William. 1992. “Prototypes and Conceptual Analysis.” Topoi 11, 59-70.
  • Rey, Georges. 1983. “Concepts and Stereotypes.” Cognition 15, 237-262.
  • Rey, Georges. 1985. “Concepts and Conceptions: A Reply to Smith, Medin and Rips.” Cognition 19, 297-303.
  • Rosch, Eleanor. 1999. “Principles of Categorization.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 189-206.
  • Schlipp, P. (Ed.). 1968. The Philosophy of G. E. Moore. LaSalle, Illinois: Open Court.
  • Smith, Edward E. 1989. “Three Distinctions About Concepts and Categorization.” Mind and Language 4 (1, 2), 57-61.
  • Smith, Edward E., and Medin, Douglas L. 1981. Categories and Concepts. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Smith, Edward E. 1999. “The Exemplar View.” In Margolis and Laurence 1999, 207-221.
  • Smith, Edward E., Medin, Douglas L., and Rips, Lance J. 1984. “A Psychological Approach to Concepts: Comments on Rey’s ‘Concepts and Stereotypes.’” Cognition 17, 265-274.
  • Sosa, Ernest. 1983. “Classical Analysis.” Journal of Philosophy 80 (11), 695-710.
  • Stalnaker, Robert. 2001. “Metaphysics Without Conceptual Analysis.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 62 (3), 631-636.
  • Williamson, Timothy. 1994. Vagueness. New York: Routledge. Williamson, Timothy. 1999. “Vagueness and Ignorance.” In Keefe and Smith 1999, 265-280.

Author Information

Dennis Earl
Coastal Carolina University
U. S. A.



Fallibilism is the epistemological thesis that no belief (theory, view, thesis, and so on) can ever be rationally supported or justified in a conclusive way. Always, there remains a possible doubt as to the truth of the belief. Fallibilism applies that assessment even to science’s best-entrenched claims and to people’s best-loved commonsense views. Some epistemologists have taken fallibilism to imply skepticism, according to which none of those claims or views are ever well justified or knowledge. In fact, though, it is fallibilist epistemologists (which is to say, the majority of epistemologists) who tend not to be skeptics about the existence of knowledge or justified belief. Generally, those epistemologists see themselves as thinking about knowledge and justification in a comparatively realistic way — by recognizing the fallibilist realities of human cognitive capacities, even while accommodating those fallibilities within a theory that allows perpetually fallible people to have knowledge and justified beliefs. Still, although that is the aim of most epistemologists, the question arises of whether it is a coherent aim. Are they pursuing a coherent way of thinking about knowledge and justification? Much current philosophical debate is centered upon that question. Epistemologists generally seek to understand knowledge and justification in a way that permits fallibilism to be describing a benign truth about how we can gain knowledge and justified beliefs. One way of encapsulating that project is by asking whether it is possible for a person ever to have fallible knowledge and justification.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Formulating Fallibilism: Preliminaries
  3. Formulating Fallibilism: A Thesis about Justification
  4. Formulating Fallibilism: Necessary Truths
  5. Empirical Evidence of Fallibility
  6. Philosophical Sources of Fallibilism: Hume
  7. Philosophical Sources of Fallibilism: Descartes
  8. Implications of Fallibilism: No Knowledge?
  9. Implications of Fallibilism: Knowing Fallibly?
  10. Implications of Fallibilism: No Justification?
  11. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The term “fallibilism” comes from the nineteenth century American philosopher Charles Sanders Peirce, although the basic idea behind the term long predates him. According to that basic idea, no beliefs (or opinions or views or theses, and so on) are so well justified or supported by good evidence or apt circumstances that they could not be false. Fallibilism tells us that there is no conclusive justification and no rational certainty for any of our beliefs or theses. That is fallibilism in its strongest form, being applied to all beliefs without exception. In principle, it is also possible to be a restricted fallibilist, accepting a fallibilism only about some narrower class of beliefs. For example, we might be fallibilists about whatever beliefs we gain through the use of our senses — even while remaining convinced that we possess the ability to reason in ways that can, at least sometimes, manifest infallibility. Thus, one special case of this possible selectivity would have us being fallibilists about empirical science even while exempting mathematical reasoning from that verdict. For simplicity, though (and because it represents the thinking of most epistemologists), in what follows I will generally discuss fallibilism in its unrestricted form. (The exception will be section 6, where a particularly significant, but seemingly narrower, form of fallibilism will be presented.)

Fallibilism is an epistemologically pivotal thesis, and our initial priority must be to formulate it carefully. Almost all contemporary epistemologists will say that they are fallibilists. Yet the vast majority of them also wish not to be skeptics. They would rather not be committed to embracing principles about the nature of knowledge and justification which commit them to denying that there can be any knowledge or justified belief. This desire coexists, nonetheless, with the belief that fallibility is rampant. Many epistemological debates, it transpires, can be understood in terms of how they try to balance these epistemologically central desires. So, can we find a precise philosophical understanding of ourselves as being perpetually fallible even though reassuringly rational and, for the most part, knowledgeable?

2. Formulating Fallibilism: Preliminaries

An initial statement of fallibilism might be this:

All beliefs are fallible. (No belief is infallible.)

But what, exactly, is that saying? Here are three claims it is not making.

(1) Fallible people. It is not saying just that all believers — all people — are fallible. A person as such is fallible if, at least sometimes, he is capable of forming false beliefs. But that is compatible with the person’s often — on some other occasions — believing infallibly. And that is not a state of affairs which is compatible with fallibilism.

(2) Actually false beliefs. Nor is fallibilism the thesis that in fact all beliefs are false. That possibility is allowed — but it is not required — by fallibilism. Hence, it is false to portray fallibilism — as commentators on science, in particular, sometimes do — in these terms:

All scientific beliefs are false. This includes all scientific theories, of course. (After all, even scientific theories are only theories. So they are fallible — and therefore false.)

Regardless of whether or not that is a correct claim about scientific beliefs and theories, it is not an accurate portrayal of what fallibilism means to say. The key term in fallibilism, as we have so far formulated it, is “fallible.” And this conveys — through its use of “-ible” — only some kind of possibility of falsity, rather than the definite presence of actual falsity.

(3) Contingent truths. Take the belief that there are currently at least one thousand kangaroos alive in Australia. That belief is true, although it need not have been. It could have been false — in that the world need not have been such as to make it true. So, the belief is only contingently true (as philosophers say). By definition, any contingent truth could have failed to be true. But even if we were to accept that all truths are only contingently true, we would not be committed to fallibilism. The recognition that contingent truths exist is not what underlies fallibilism. The claim that any contingent truth could instead have been false is not the fallibilist claim, because fallibilism is not a thesis about truths in themselves. Instead, it is about our attempts in themselves to accept or believe truths. It concerns a kind of fundamental limitation first and foremost upon our powers of rational thought and representation. And although a truth’s being contingent means that it did not have to be true, this does not mean that it will, or even that it can, be altering its truth-value (by becoming false) in such a way as to deceive you. For instance, the truth that there are now more than one thousand kangaroos alive in Australia is not made false even by there being only five kangaroos alive in Australia in two days time from now.

3. Formulating Fallibilism: A Thesis about Justification

Given section 2’s details, a better (and routine) expression of fallibilism is this:

F: All beliefs are only, at best, fallibly justified.

F’s main virtue, as a formulation of fallibilism, is its locating the culprit fallibility as arising within the putative justification that is present on behalf of a given belief. The kind of justification in question is called "epistemic justification" by epistemologists. And the suggested formulation, F, of fallibilism is saying that there is never conclusive justification for the truth of a given belief.

There are competing epistemological theories of what, exactly, epistemic justification is. Roughly speaking, though, it is whatever would make a belief more, rather than less, rationally well supported or established. This sort of rationality is meant to be truth-directed. For example (as Conee and Feldman 2004 would argue), whenever some evidence is providing epistemic support — justification — for a belief, this is a matter of its supporting the truth of that belief. In that sense, the evidence provides good reason to adopt the belief — to adopt it as true. Or (to take another example, such as would be approved of by the kind of theory from Goldman 1979) a believer might have formed her belief within some circumstance or in some way that — regardless of whether she can notice this — makes her belief likely to be true. (And when are these kinds of justificatory support present? In particular, are they only ever present if they are guaranteeing that the belief being supported is true? Are any actually false beliefs ever justified? Section 10 will focus on the question of whether fallible justification is ever present, either for true or for false beliefs.)

Just as there are competing interpretations of the nature of epistemic justification, epistemologists exercise care in how they read F. Perhaps the most natural reading of it says that no one is ever so situated — even when possessing evidence in favor of the truth of a particular belief — that, if she were to be rational in the sense of respecting and understanding and responding just to that evidence, she could not proceed to doubt that the belief is true. More generally, the idea behind F is that, no matter how good one’s justification is in support of a particular belief’s being true, that justification is never so good as to be conclusive — leaving no room for anyone who might be rationally attending to that justification not to have the belief it is supporting. At any stage, according to F, doubt could sensibly (in some relevant sense of “sensibly”) arise as to the truth of the particular belief.

Often, therefore, this kind of possible doubt is called a rational doubt. This is not to say that, necessarily, the most rational reaction is to be swayed by the doubt, accepting it as decisive; whether one should react like that is a separate issue, probably deserving to be decided only after some subtle argument. The term “rational doubt” is meant only to distinguish this sort of actual or possible doubt from a patently irrational one — a doubt that is psychologically, but not even prima facie rationally, available. How might a doubt that is not even prima facie rational arise? Here is one possible way. Imagine a person who is attending to evidence for the truth of a particular belief, yet who refuses to accept the belief’s being true. Suppose that this refusal is due either (i) to her misunderstanding the evidence or (ii) to some psychological quirk such as a general lack of respect for evidence at all or such as mere obstinacy (without her supplying counter-reasons disputing the truth or power of the evidence). There is no accounting for why some people will in fact doubt a given belief: psychologically, doubt could be an option even in the face of rationally conclusive evidence. Nevertheless, fallibilism is not a thesis about that psychological option. The option it describes concerns rationality. Fallibilism is about what it claims to be the ever-present availability of rational doubt.

Accordingly, one possible way of misinterpreting F would involve confusing the concept of a rational doubt with that of a subjectively felt doubt or, maybe more generally, a psychologically present doubt. Rational doubts need not be psychologically actual doubts, just as psychologically actual ones need not be rational. In theory, a person might have or feel some doubt as to whether a particular claim is true — some doubt which she should not have or feel. (Perhaps she is misevaluating the strength of the evidence she has in support of that claim.) Equally, someone might have or feel no doubt as to the truth of a belief he has — when he should have or feel some such doubt. (Perhaps he, too, is misevaluating the strength of the evidence he has in support of his belief.) In either case, the way in which the person is in fact reacting — by having, or by not having, an actual doubt — does not determine whether his or her evidence is in fact providing rationally conclusive support. That is because a particular reaction — of doubting or of not doubting — might not be as justified or rational in itself as is possible. (By analogy, we may keep in mind the case — unfortunately, all too common a kind of case — of a brutal tyrant who claims, sincerely, to have a clear conscience at the end of his life. The morality of his actions is more obviously to be explicated in terms of what his conscience should be telling him rather than of what it is telling him.) In effect, F is saying that no matter what evidence you have, no matter how carefully you have accumulated it, and no matter how rationally you use and evaluate it, you can never thereby have conclusive justification for a belief which you wish to support via all that evidence. Equally, F is saying that no matter what circumstance you occupy, and no matter how you are forming a particular belief, no guarantee is thereby being provided of your belief being true. In those respects (according to F), any justification you have is fallible — and it will remain so, no matter what you do with it, no matter how assiduously you attend to it, no matter what the circumstances are in which you are operating. The problem will also remain, no matter how you might supplement or try to improve your evidence or circumstances. Any possible addition or alteration that you might make will continue leaving open at least a possibility — one to which a careful and rational thinker would in principle respond respectfully if she were to notice it — of your belief’s being false.

In that way, fallibilism — as a thesis about justification — travels more deeply into the human cognitive condition than it would do if it were a point merely about logic, say. It is not saying that no belief is ever supported by evidence whose content logically entails the first belief’s content. An example of that situation would be provided by a person’s having, as evidence, the belief that he is a living, breathing Superman — from which he infers that he is alive. The evidence’s content (“I am a living, breathing Superman”) does logically entail the truth of the inferred content (“I am alive”). (This attribution of logical validity or entailment means — from standard deductive logic — that it is impossible for the first content to be true without the second one also being true.) But the justification being supplied is fallible, because — obviously — the person will have, at best, inconclusive justification for thinking that he is a living, breathing Superman in the first place. The putative justification is the belief (about being Superman) and its history, not only its content and the associated logical relations. Yet fallibilism says that, even when all such further features are taken into account, some potential will remain for rational doubt to be present.

4. Formulating Fallibilism: Necessary Truths

Nevertheless, a modification of F (in section 3) is required, it seems, if fallibilism is to apply to beliefs like mathematical ones or to beliefs reporting theses of pure logic, for instance. Most philosophers would accept that it is possible to be fallible in holding such a belief — and that this is so, even given that there is a sense in which such a belief, when true, could not ever be false. Thus, perhaps mathematical believing is a fallible process, able to lead to false beliefs. Perhaps this is so, even if mathematical truths themselves never “just happen” to be true — never depending upon changeable surrounding circumstances for their truth, hence never being susceptible to being rendered false by some change in those surrounding circumstances. How should we modify F, therefore, so as to understand the way in which fallibility can nonetheless be present in such a case? More generally, how should we modify F, so as to understand the prospect of a person ever having fallible beliefs (let alone only fallible ones) in what philosophers call necessary truths?

By definition, any truth which is not contingent is necessary. The class of necessary truths is the class of propositions or contents which, necessarily, are true. They could not have failed to be true. And that class will generally be thought to contain — maybe most significantly — mathematical truths. Consider, then, the belief that 2 + 2 = 4. In itself (almost every philosopher will concur), there is no possibility of that belief’s being false. However, if it is impossible for that belief to be false, then there is also no possible evidence on the basis of which — in coming to believe that 2 + 2 = 4 — a person could be forming a false belief. In this way, no belief that 2 + 2 = 4 could be merely fallibly justified — at least as this phenomenon has been portrayed in F. Yet it is clear — or so most epistemologists will aver — that mathematical believing can be fallible. Indeed, if fallibilism is true, all mathematical beliefs will be subject to some sort of fallibility: even mathematical beliefs would, at best, be only fallibly justified. How, therefore, is this to be understood?

Here is one suggestion — F* — which modifies F by drawing upon some standard epistemological thinking. The aim in moving from F to F* would be to allow for the possibility of having a fallible belief in a necessary truth:

F*: All beliefs are, at best, only fallibly justified. (And a belief is fallibly justified when — even if the belief, considered in itself, could not be false — the justification for it exemplifies or reflects some more general way or process of thinking or forming beliefs, a way or process which is itself fallible due to its capacity to result in false beliefs.)

Sections 5 and 7 will describe a few possible reasons for a fallibilist to regard your belief that 2 + 2 = 4 as being fallible. In the meantime, we need only note schematically how F* would accommodate those possible reasons. The basic approach would be as follows. Although your belief that 2 + 2 = 4 cannot be false (once it is present), your supposed justification for it is fallible. This could be so in a few ways. For a start, maybe you are merely repeating by rote something you were told many years ago by a somewhat unreliable school teacher. (Imagine the teacher having been poor at making accurate claims within most other areas of mathematics. Even with respect to the elements of mathematics about which she was accurate, she might have been merely repeating by rote what she had been told by her own early — and similarly unreliable — teachers.) The fallibility of memory is also relevant: over the years, one forgets much. Still, your current belief that 2 + 2 = 4 seems accurate. And it need not be present only because of your fallible memory of what your fallible teacher told you. Suppose that you are now very sophisticated in your mathematical thinking: in particular, your justification for your belief that 2 + 2 = 4 is purely mathematical in content. That justification involves clever representation, via precisely defined symbols, of abstract ideas. Nevertheless, even such purely mathematical reasoning can mislead you (no matter that it has not done so on this occasion). Really proving that 2 + 2 = 4 is quite difficult; and when people are seeking to grasp and to implement such proofs, human fallibility may readily intrude. Actual attempts to establish mathematical truths need not always lead to accurate or true beliefs.

At any rate, that is how a fallibilist might well analyze the case.

5. Empirical Evidence of Fallibility

How can we ascertain which of our ways of thinking are fallible? Both ordinary observation and sophisticated empirical research are usually regarded as able to help us here, by revealing some of the means by which fallibility enters our cognitive lives. I will list several of the seemingly fallible means of belief-formation and belief-maintenance that have been noticed.

(1) Misusing evidence. Apparently, people often misevaluate the strength of their evidence. By taking it to be stronger or weaker support than in fact it is for the truth of a particular belief, a person could easily be led to adopt or retain a false, rather than true, belief. Indeed, there are many possible ways not to use evidence properly. For example, people do not always notice, let alone compare and resolve, conflicting pieces of evidence. They might overlook some of the evidence available to them. There can be inattention to details of their evidence. And so forth.

(2) Unreliable senses. How many of us have wholly reliable — always accurate — senses? Shortsightedness is not so rare. The same is true of long-sightedness. People can have poor hearing, not to mention less-than-perfectly discerning senses of smell, taste, and so on. Sensory illusions and hallucinations affect us, too. The road seems to ripple under the heat of the sun; the stick appears to bend as it enters the glass of water; and so forth. In such cases we will think, upon reflection, that what we seem to sense is something we only seem to sense.

(3) Unreliable memory. At times, people suffer lapses of memory; and they can realize this, experiencing “blanks” as they endeavor to recall something. They can also feel as though they are remembering something, when actually this feeling is inaccurate. (A “false memory” is like that. The event which a person seems to recall, for instance, never actually happened.)

(4) Reasoning fallaciously. To reason in a logically invalid way is to reason in a way which, even given the truth of one’s premises or evidence, can lead to falsity. It is thereby to reason fallibly. Do we often reason like that? Seemingly, yes. Of course, often we and others realize that we are doing so. And we and those others might generally be satisfied with our admittedly fallible reasoning. (But should we ever regard it with satisfaction? Section 10 will consider this kind of question.) There are times, though, when we and others do not notice the fallibility in our reasoning. On those occasions, we are — without realizing this about ourselves — reasoning fallaciously. That is, we are reasoning in ways which are logically invalid but which most people mistakenly, albeit routinely, regard as being logically valid.

(5) Intelligence limitations. Is each of us so intelligent as never to make mistakes which a more intelligent person would be less likely (all else being equal) to make? Presumably none of us escape that limitation. Do we notice people making mistakes due to their exercising (and perhaps possessing) less intelligence than was needed not to make those mistakes? We appear to do so. Sometimes (often too late), we observe this in ourselves, too.

(6) Representational limitations. We use language and thought to represent or describe reality — hopefully, to do this accurately. But people have often, we believe, made mistakes about the world around them because of inadequacies in their representational or descriptive resources. For example, they can have been applying misleading and clumsily constructed concepts — ones which could well be replaced within an improved science. (And this sort of problem — at least to judge by the apparent inescapability of disputes among its practitioners — might be even more acute within such areas of thought as philosophy.)

(7) Situational limitations. It is not uncommon for people to make mistakes of fact because they have biases or prejudices that impede their ability to perceive or represent or reflect accurately upon those facts. Such mistakes may be made when people are manifesting an insufficiently developed awareness of pertinent aspects of the world. Maybe a person’s early upbringing, and how she has subsequently lived her life, has not exposed her to a particularly wide range of ideas. Perhaps she has not encountered what are, as it happens, more accurate ideas or principles than the ones she is applying in her attempts to understand the world. All of this might well prevent her even noticing some relevant aspects of the world. (When both I and a doctor gaze at an X-ray, only one of us notices much of medical relevance.)

That list of realistically possible sources of fallibility — philosophers will suspect — could be continued indefinitely. And its scope is disturbingly expansive. Thus, even when you do not feel as though a belief of yours has been formed or maintained in some way that manifests any of those failings, you could be mistaken about that. This is a factual matter; or so most philosophers will say. On any given occasion, it is an empirical question as to whether in fact you are being fallible in one of those ways. (Notably, it is not simply a matter of whether you are feeling fallible.) Accordingly, many epistemologists have paid attention to pertinent empirical research by psychiatrists, neurologists, biologists, anthropologists, and the like, into actual limitations upon human cognitive powers. Data uncovered so far have unveiled the existence of much fallibility. (See, for example, Nisbett and Ross 1980; Kahneman, Slovic, and Tversky 1982.)

Some epistemologists have found this to be worrying in itself. Still, has enough fallibility thereby been uncovered to justify an acceptance of fallibilism? (Remember that fallibilism, in its most general form, is the thesis that all of our beliefs are fallible.) This, too, is at least partly an empirical question. It is the question of just how fallible people are as a group — and, naturally, of just how much a given individual ever manages to transcend such limitations upon people in general. How fallibly, as it happens, do people ever form and maintain beliefs? Is every single one of us fallible enough to render every single one of our beliefs fallible?

It is difficult, perhaps impossible, to use personal observations and empirical research to answer those questions conclusively. (And fallibilism would deny that this is possible anyway.) For presumably such fallibilities would also afflict people as observers and as scientific inquirers. Hence, this would occur even when theorists — let alone casual observers — are investigating those fallibilities. The history of science reveals that many scientific theories which were at one time considered to be true have subsequently been supplanted, with later theories deeming the earlier ones to have been false.

Is science therefore especially fallible as a way of forming beliefs about the world? That is a matter of some philosophical dispute. Empirical science is performed by fallible people, often involving much fallible coordination among themselves. It relies on the fallible process of observation. And it can generate quite complicated theories and beliefs — with that complexity affording scope for marked fallibility. Yet in spite of these sources of fallibility nestling within it (when it is conceived of as a method), science might well (when it is conceived of as a body of theses and doctrines) encompass the most cognitively impressive store of knowledge that humans have ever amassed. Even if not all of its theories and beliefs are true (and therefore not all of them are knowledge), a significant percentage of them seem to have a strong case for being knowledge. Is that compatible with science’s fallibility, even its inherent fallibility, as a method? Or are none of its theories and beliefs knowledge, simply because (as later scientists will realize) some of them are not? Alternatively, are none of them knowledge, because none of them are conclusively justified? That depends on what kind of knowledge scientific knowledge would be. This is a subtle matter, asking us first to consider in general whether there can be inconclusively justified knowledge at all. Section 9 will indicate how epistemologists might take a step towards answering that question. It will do so by discussing the idea of fallible knowledge. (And section10 will comment on science and fallible justification.)

6. Philosophical Sources of Fallibilism: Hume

Section 5 indicated some empirical grounds on which fallibilism might be thought to be true. Epistemologists have also provided non-empirical arguments for fallibilism, both in its strongest form and in important-but-weaker forms. This section and the next will present two of those arguments.

One of them comes from the eighteenth-century Scottish philosopher David Hume’s classic invention of what is now called inductive skepticism. (For a succinct version of his argument, see his 1902 [1748], sec. IV. For some sense of the philosophical and historical dimensions of that notion, see Buckle 2001: part 2, ch. 4.) At the core of his skeptical argument was an important-even-if-possibly-not-wholly-general fallibilism. Hume’s argument showed, at the very least, the inescapable fallibility of an extremely significant kind of belief — any belief which either is or could be an inductive extrapolation from observational data. According to Hume, no beliefs about what is yet to be observed (by a particular person or some group) can be infallibly established on the basis of what has been observed (by that person or that group). Consider any use of present and past observations, perhaps to derive and at least to support, some view that aims to describe aspects of the world that have not yet been observed. (Standard examples include people’s seeking to justify the belief that the sun will rise tomorrow, by using past observations of it having risen, and people’s many observations of black ravens supposedly justifying the belief that all ravens are black.) Hume noticed that observations can never provide conclusive assurance — a proof — that the world is not about to change from what it has thus far been observed to be like. Even if all observed Fs have been Gs, say, this does not entail that any, let alone all, of the currently unobserved Fs are also Gs. No such guarantee can be given by the past observations. And this is so, no matter how many observations of Fs have been made (short of having observed all of them, while realizing that this has occurred).

Hume presents his argument as one that uncovers a limitation upon the power or reach of reason — that is, upon how much can be revealed to us by reason as such. Possibly, this is in part because that is the non-trivial aspect of his argument. Overall, his argument is describing a limitation upon the power or reach both of reason and of observation — upon how far these faculties or capacities can take us towards proving the truth of various beliefs which, inevitably, we find ourselves having. But that limitation reflects both a point that is non-trivially true (about reason) and one that is trivially true (about observation). Hume combines those two points (as follows) to attain his fallibilism. (1) It is trivially true that any observations that have been made at and before a given time have not been of what, at that time, is yet to be observed. (2) It is true (although not trivially so) that our powers of reason face a limitation of their own, one that leaves them unable to overcome (1)’s limitation upon observation. Our capacity to reason — our powers simply of reflection — must concede that, regardless of however unlikely this might seem at the time, the unobserved Fs could be different in a relevant way from those that have been observed. Hence, in particular, whatever powers of reason we might use in seeking to move beyond our observations will be unable to eliminate the possibility that the presently unobserved Fs are quite different (as regards being Gs) from the Fs that have been observed. Our powers of reason must concede — again, even if this seems unlikely at the time — that continued observations of Fs might be about to begin giving results that are quite different to what such observations have previously revealed about Fs being Gs. Obviously, the past observations of Fs (all of which, we are supposing, were Gs) do not tell us that this is likely to occur, let alone that it is about to do so. But, crucially, pure reason tells us that it could be about to occur. (3) Consequently, if we combine (1) and (2), we reach this result:

Neither observation nor reason can reveal with rational certainty anything about the nature of any of the Fs that are presently unobserved.

In other words, there is always a “logical gap” between the observations of Fs that have been made (either by some individual or a group) and any conclusion regarding Fs that have not yet been observed (by either that individual or that group).

Our appreciation of that gap’s existence is made specific — even dramatic — by the Humean thought that the world could be about to change in the relevant respect. We thus see that fallibility cannot be excluded from any justification which we might think is present for a belief that either is or could be an extrapolation from some observations. Such a belief could be about the future (“The sun will rise tomorrow”), the presently unobserved past (“Dinosaurs used to live here”), populations (“The cats in this neighborhood are vicious”), and so on. Beliefs like that are pivotal in our mental lives, it seems.

Indeed, as some philosophers argue, they can be all-but-ubiquitous — even surprisingly so. When you believe that you are seeing a cat, is this an extrapolation from observations? At first glance, it seems straightforwardly observational itself. Yet maybe it is an extrapolation in a less obvious way. Perhaps it is an extrapolation from both your present sensory experience and similar ones that you have had in the past. Perhaps it is implicitly a prediction that the object in front of you is not about to begin looking and acting like a dog, and that it will continue looking and acting like a cat. (Is this part of what it means to say that the object is a cat — a genuine-flesh-and-blood-physical-object cat?) Are even simple observational beliefs therefore concealed or subtle extrapolations? If they are to be justified, will this need to be inductive justification?

If so, the Humean verdict (when formulated in contemporary epistemological language) remains that, even at best, such beliefs are only fallibly justified. Any justification for them would need to be observations from which they might have been extrapolated (even if in fact this is not, psychologically speaking, how they were reached). And no such justification could ever rationally eliminate the possibility that any group of apparently supportive observations is misleading as to what the world would be found to be like if further observations were to be made.

That is Hume’s inductive fallibilism — a fallibilism about all actual or possible inductive extrapolations from observations. Many interpreters believe that his argument established — or at least that Hume meant it to establish — more than a kind of fallibilism. This is why it is generally called an argument for inductive skepticism, not just for inductive fallibilism. (On Hume’s transition from fallibilism to skepticism, see Stove 1973.) Accordingly, his conclusion is sometimes presented more starkly, as saying that observations never rationally show or establish or support or justify at all any extrapolations beyond observational data, even ones that purport only to describe a likelihood of some observed pattern’s being perpetuated. At its most combative, his conclusion might be said — and sometimes is, especially by non-philosophers — to reveal that predictions are rationally useless or untenable, or that any beliefs “going beyond” observational reports are, rationally speaking, nothing more than guesses. Whether or not that skeptical thesis is true depends, for a start, upon whether there can be such a thing as fallible justification — or whether, once fallibility is present, justification departs. Section 10 will consider that issue.

In any case, Hume’s fallibilism is generally considered by philosophers (for instance, see Quine 1969; Miller 1994: 2-13; Howson 2000: ch. 1) to have struck a serious blow against the otherwise beguiling picture of science as delivering conclusive knowledge of the inner continuing workings of the world. It is not uncommon for people to react to this interpretation of Hume’s result by inferring that therefore science — with its reliance upon observations as data, with which it supports its predictions and more general principles and posits — never really gives us knowledge of a world beyond those observations. The appropriateness of that skeptical inference depends on whether or not there can be such a thing as fallible knowledge — or whether, once fallibility is present, knowledge departs. Section 9 will consider that issue.

7. Philosophical Sources of Fallibilism: Descartes

Does Hume’s reasoning (described in section 6) support fallibilism in its most general form? It does, if all beliefs depend for their justification upon extrapolations from observational experience. And section 6 also indicated briefly how there can be more beliefs like that than we might realize. Nevertheless, the usual philosophical reading of Hume’s argument does not assume that the argument shows that all beliefs are to be supported either fallibly or not at all. We should therefore pay attention to another equally famous philosophical argument, one whose conclusion is definitely that no beliefs at all are conclusively justified.

This argument comes to us from the seventeenth-century French philosopher René Descartes. In his seminal Meditations on First Philosophy (1911 [1641]), Descartes ended Meditation I skeptically, denying himself all knowledge. How was that skeptical conclusion derived? It was based upon a fallibilism — a wholly general fallibilism. And his argument for that fallibilism — the Evil Genius (or Evil Demon) argument, as it is often called — may be presented in this way:

Any beliefs you have about … well, anything … could be present within you merely because some evil genius or demon has installed them there. And they might have been installed so as to deceive you: maybe any or all of them are false. Admittedly, you do not feel as if this has happened within you. Nonetheless, it could have done so. Note that the evil genius is not simply some other person, even an especially clever one. Rather, it would be God-like in pertinent powers although malevolent in accompanying intent — mysteriously able to implant any false beliefs within you so that their presence will feel natural to you, leaving you unaware that any of your beliefs are bedeviled by this untoward causal origin. You will never notice the evil genius’s machinations. All will seem normal to you within your mind. It will feel just as it would if you were observing and thinking carefully and insightfully.

Is that state of affairs possible? Indeed it is (said Descartes, and most epistemologists have since agreed with him about that). Moreover, if it is always present as a possibility, then one pressing part of it — your being mistaken — is always present as a possibility. This is always present, as a possibility afflicting each of your beliefs. What is true of you in this respect, too, is true of everyone. The evil genius could be manipulating all of our minds. Hence, any belief could be false, no matter who has it and no matter how much evidence they have on its behalf. Even the evidence, after all, could have been installed and controlled by an evil genius.

Interestingly, the reference to an evil genius as such, provocative though it is, was not essential even to Descartes’ own reasoning. In Meditation I, he had already — immediately prior to outlining the Evil Genius argument — presented a sufficiently fallibilist worry. It concerned the possibility of his having been formed or created in some way — whatever way that might be — which would leave him perpetually fallible. He wanted to believe that God was his creator. However (he wondered), would God create him as a being who constantly makes mistakes, or who is at least always liable to do so? God would be powerful enough to do this. But (Descartes also thought) surely God would have had no reason to allow him to make even some mistakes. Yet manifestly Descartes does make them. So (he inferred), he could not take for granted at this early stage of his inquiry (as it is portrayed in his Meditations) that he has actually been formed or created by a perfect God. The evidence of his fallibility opens the door to the possibility that he does not have that causal background. So (he continues), maybe his causal origins are something less than perfect, as of course they would be if anything less than a perfect God were involved in them. In that event, however, he is even more likely to make mistakes than he would be if God was his creator. In one way or the other, therefore (concludes Descartes), fallibility is unavoidable for him: no belief of his is immune from the possibility of being mistaken. Thus, fallibilism is thrust upon Descartes by this reasoning. (He realizes, nonetheless, that it is subtle reasoning. He might not retain it in his thinking. He might overlook his fallibility, if he is not mentally vigilant. Hence, he proceeds to describe the evil genius possibility to himself, as a graphic way of holding the fallibilism fast in his mind. The Evil Genius argument is, in effect, a philosophical mnemonic for him.)

Descartes himself did not remain a fallibilist. He believed that (in his Meditation II) he had found a convincing answer to that fallibilist argument. This answer was his Cogito, one of philosophy’s emblematic moments, and it arose via the following reasoning. Descartes thought that if ever in fact he is being deceived by an evil genius, at least he will thereby be in existence at these moments. (It is impossible to be an object of deception without existing.) The deception would be inflicted upon him while he exists as a thinker — specifically, as someone thinking whatever false thoughts are being controlled within him by the evil genius. But this entails (reasoned Descartes) that there is a kind of thought about which he cannot be deceived, even by an evil genius. Because he can know that he is having a particular thought, he can know that he exists at that time. And so he thought, “I think, therefore I am.” (This is the usual translation into English of the “Cogito, ergo sum” from Latin. The latter version is from Descartes’ Discourse on Method.) He would thereby know that much, at any rate (inferred Descartes). He need not — and at this point in his inquiry he does not think that he can — know which, if any, of his beliefs about the wider world are true. Nonetheless, he has knowledge of his inner world — knowledge of his own thinking. He would know not only that he is thinking, but even what it is that he is thinking. These beliefs about his mental life are conclusively supported, too, because — as he has just argued — they are beyond the relevant reach of any evil genius. No evil genius can give him these thoughts (that he is thinking and hence existing) and thereby be deceiving him.

But most subsequent epistemologists have been more swayed by the fallibilism emerging from the Evil Genius argument than by Descartes’ reply to that argument. (For a discussion of these issues in Descartes’ project, see Curley 1978; Wilson 1978.) One common epistemological objection to his use of the Cogito is as follows: How could Descartes have known that it was he in particular who was thinking? Shouldn’t he have rested content with the more cautious and therefore less dubitable thought, “There is some thinking occurring” — instead of inferring the less cautious and therefore more dubitable thought, “I am thinking”? That objection was proposed by Georg Lichtenberg in the eighteenth century. (For a criticism of it, see Williams 1978: ch. 3.) An advocate of it might call upon such reasoning as this:

In order to know that it is his own thinking, as against just some thinking or other, Descartes has to know already — on independent grounds — that he exists. However, in that event he would not know of his existing, only through his knowing of the thinking actually occurring: he would have some other source of knowledge of his existence. Yet his Cogito had been relied upon by him because he was assuming that his knowing of the thinking actually occurring was (in the face of the imagined evil genius) the only way for him to know of his existence.

That reasoning would claim to give us the following results. (1) Descartes does not know that he is thinking — because he would have to know already that he exists (in order to be the subject of the thinking which is noticed), and because he can know that he exists only if he already knows that he is thinking (the latter knowledge being all that is claimed to be invulnerable to the Evil Genius argument). (2) Similarly, Descartes does not know that he exists — because he would have to know already that he is thinking (this being all that is claimed to be invulnerable to the evil genius argument), and because he could know that he is thinking only by already knowing that he exists (thereby being able to be the subject of the thinking that is being noticed). (3) And once we combine those two results, (1) and (2), what do we find? The objection’s conclusion is that Descartes knows of his thinking and of his existence all at once — or not at all. In short, he is not entitled — as a knower — to the “therefore” in his “I think, therefore I exist.”

That is one possible objection to the Cogito. Still, even if it succeeds on its own terms, it leaves open the following question. Can Descartes have all of that knowledge — the knowledge of his thinking and the knowledge of his existence — all at once? This depends on whether, once he has doubted as strongly and widely as he has done, he can have knowledge even of what is in his own mind. In the mid-twentieth century, the Austrian philosopher Ludwig Wittgenstein mounted a deep challenge to anything like the Cogito as a way of grounding our thought and knowledge. Was Descartes legitimately using words at all so as to form clearly known thoughts, such as “I am thinking”? How could he know what these even mean, unless he is applying some understood language? And Wittgenstein argued that no one could genuinely be thinking thoughts which are not depending upon an immersion in a “public” language, presumably a language shared by other speakers, certainly one already built up over time. In which case, Descartes would be mistaken in believing that, even if the possibility of an evil genius imperils all of his other knowledge, he could retain the knowledge of his own thinking. For even that thinking would have its content only by using terms borrowed from a public language. Hence, Descartes would have to be presupposing some knowledge of that public world, even when supposedly retreating to the inner comfort and security of knowing just what he is thinking. (It should be noted that Wittgenstein himself did not generally direct his reasoning — his Private Language argument, as it came to be called — specifically against Descartes by name. For Wittgenstein’s reasoning, see his 1978 [1953] secs. 243-315, 348-412.)

Of course, even if the Cogito does in fact succeed, epistemologists all-but-unite in denying that such conclusiveness would be available for many — or perhaps any — other beliefs. Accordingly, we would still confront an all-but-universal fallibilism, with Descartes having provided an easy way to remember our all-but-inescapable fallibility. In any case, it remains possible that the Cogito does not succeed, and that instead the evil genius argument shows that no belief is ever conclusively justified. Descartes’ argument is not the only one for such a fallibilism. But most epistemologists still refer to it routinely and with some respect, as being a paradigm argument for the most general form of fallibilism.

8. Implications of Fallibilism: No Knowledge?

If we were to accept that fallibilism is true, to what else would we thereby be committed? In particular, what further philosophical views must we hold (all else being equal) if we hold fallibilism?

Probably the most significant idea that arises, in response to that question, is the suggestion that any fallibilist about justification has to be a skeptic about the existence of knowledge. (There is also the proposal that she must be a skeptic about the existence of justification. Section 10 will discuss that proposal.) This potential implication has made fallibilism particularly interesting to many philosophers. Should we accept the skeptical thesis that because (as fallibilists claim) no one is ever holding a belief infallibly, no one ever has a belief which amounts to being knowledge? In this section and the next, we will consider that question — first (in this section) by examining how one might argue for the skeptical thesis, next (in section 9) by seeing how one might argue against it.

That hypothesized skeptic is reasoning along these lines:

  1. Any belief, if it is to be knowledge, needs to be conclusively justified.
  2. No belief is conclusively justified. [Fallibilism tell us this.]
  3. Hence, no belief is knowledge. [This follows from 1-plus-2.]

Fallibilism gives us 2; deductive logic gives us 3 (as following from 1 and 2); and in this section we are not asking whether fallibilism is true. (We are assuming – for the sake of argument – that it is.) So, our immediate challenge is to ask whether 1 is true. Is it a correct thesis about knowledge? Does knowledge require infallibility (as 1 claims it does)? The rest of this section will evaluate what are probably the two most commonly encountered arguments for the claim that knowledge is indeed like that.

(1) Impossibility. Many people say this about knowledge:

If you have knowledge of some aspect of the world, it is impossible for you to be mistaken about that aspect. (An example: “If you know that it’s a dog, you can’t be mistaken about its being one.”)

We may call that the Impossibility of Mistake thesis. Its advocates might infer, from the conjunction of it with fallibilism, that no one ever has any knowledge. Their reasoning would be like this:

Because no one ever has conclusive justification for a belief, mistakes are always possible within one’s beliefs. Hence, no beliefs attain the rank of knowledge. (We would just think — mistakenly — that often knowledge is present.)

But almost all epistemologists would regard that sort of inference as reflecting a misunderstanding of what the Impossibility of Mistake thesis is actually saying. More specifically, they will say that there is a misunderstanding of how the term “impossible” is being used in that thesis. Here are two possible claims that the Impossibility of Mistake thesis could be thought to be making:

Any instance of knowledge is — indeed, it must be — directed at what is true.  (Knowledge entails truth.)

Any instance of knowledge has as its content what, in itself, could not possibly be false. (Knowledge entails necessary truth.)

The first of those two interpretations of the Impossibility of Mistake thesis says that knowledge, in itself, has to be knowledge of what is true. The second of the two possible interpretations says that knowledge is of what, in itself, has to be true. The two claims will be correlatively different in what they imply.

Epistemologists will insist that the first possible interpretation (which could be called the Necessarily, Knowledge Is of What Is True thesis) is manifestly true — but that it does not join together with fallibilism to entail skepticism. Recall (from (2) in section 2) that fallibilism does not deny that there can be truths among our claims and thoughts. It denies only that we are ever conclusively justified in any specific claim or thought as to which claims or thoughts are true. So, while the Necessarily, Knowledge Is of What Is True thesis entails that any case of knowledge would be knowledge of a truth, fallibilism — because it does not deny that there are truths — does not entail that there is no knowledge.

Epistemologists will also deny that the second possible interpretation (which may be called the Knowledge Is of What Is Necessarily True thesis), even if it is true, entails skepticism. Recall (this time from (3) in section 2) that fallibilism is not a thesis which denies that knowledge could ever be of contingent truths. So, while the Knowledge Is of What Is Necessarily True thesis entails that any case of knowledge would be knowledge of a necessary truth, fallibilism — because it does not, in itself, deny that there is knowledge of contingent truths — does not entail that there is no knowledge. (But most epistemologists, incidentally, will deny that the Knowledge Is of What Is Necessarily True thesis is true. They believe that — if there can be knowledge at all — there can be knowledge of contingent truths, not only of necessary ones.)

(2) Linguistic oddity. Another way in which people are sometimes led to deny that a wholly general fallibilism is compatible with people ever having knowledge is by their reflecting on some supposed linguistic infelicities. Imagine saying or thinking something like this:

“I know that’s true, even though I could be mistaken about its being true.” (An example: “I know that it’s raining, even though I could be mistaken in thinking that it is.”)

That is indeed an odd way to speak or think. Let us refer to it as The Self-Doubting Knowledge Claim. Should we infer, from that claim’s being so linguistically odd, that no instance of knowledge can allow the possibility (corresponding to the “could” in The Self-Doubting Knowledge Claim) of being mistaken? Would this imply the incompatibility of fallibilism with anyone’s ever having knowledge? Does this show that, whenever one’s evidence in support of a belief does not provide a conclusive proof, the belief fails to be knowledge?

Few epistemologists will think so. They are yet to agree on what, exactly, the oddity of a sentence like The Self-Doubting Knowledge Claim reflects. (Very roughly: there is some oddity in that claim’s expressed mixture of confidence and caution.) But few of them believe that the oddity — however, ultimately, it is to be understood — will imply that knowledge cannot ever be fallible. Their usual view is that the oddity will be found to reside only in the talking or the thinking — in someone’s actively using — any such sentence. And this could be so (they continue) without the sentence’s also actually being false, even when it is being used. Some sentences which clearly are internally logically consistent — and hence which in some sense could be true — cannot be used without a similar linguistic oddity being manifested. Try saying, for example, “It’s raining, but I don’t believe that it is.” As the twentieth century English philosopher G. E. Moore remarked (and his observation has come to be called Moore’s Paradox), something is amiss in any utterance of that kind of sentence. (For more on Moore’s Paradox, see Sorensen 1988, ch. 1; Baldwin 1990: 226-32.) This particular sentence — “It’s raining, but I don’t believe that it is” — is manifestly odd, seemingly in a similar way to any utterance of The Self-Doubting Knowledge Claim. Yet this does not entail the sentence’s being false. For each half of it could well be true; and they could be true together. The fact that it is raining is logically consistent with the speaker’s not believing that it is. (She could be quite unaware of the weather at the time.) So, the sentence could be true within itself, no matter that it cannot sensibly be uttered, say. That is, its content — what it reports — could be true, even if it cannot sensibly be asserted — as a case of reporting — in living-and-breathing speech or thought.

And the same is true (epistemologists will generally concur) of The Self-Doubting Knowledge Claim, the analogous sentence about knowledge and the possibility of being mistaken. Are they correct about that? The next section engages with that question.

9. Implications of Fallibilism: Knowing Fallibly?

The question with which section 8 ended amounts to this: is it possible for there to be fallible knowledge? If The Self-Doubting Knowledge Claim could ever be true, this would be because at least some beliefs are capable of being knowledge even when there is an accompanying possibility of their being mistaken. Any such belief, it seems, would thereby be both knowledge and fallible.

Many epistemologists, probably the majority, wish to accept that there can be fallible knowledge (although they do not always call it this). Few of them are skeptics about knowledge: almost all epistemologists believe that everyone has much knowledge. But what do they believe about the nature of such knowledge? When an epistemologist attributes knowledge, what — more fully — is being attributed? In general, epistemologists also accept that (for reasons such as those outlined in sections 5 through 7) knowledge is rarely, if ever, based upon infallible justification: they believe that there is little, if any, infallible justification. Hence, most epistemologists, it seems, accept that when people do gain knowledge, this usually, maybe always, involves fallibility.

Epistemologists generally regard this fallibilist approach as more likely to generate a realistic conception of knowledge, too. Their aim is to be tolerant of the cognitive fallibilities that people have as inquirers, while nevertheless according people knowledge (usually a great deal of it). The knowledge would therefore be gained in spite of the fallibility. And, significantly, it would be a kind of knowledge which somehow reflects and incorporates the fallibility. Indeed, it would thereby be fallible knowledge. (It would not be infallible knowledge coexisting with fallibility existing only elsewhere in people’s thinking.) With this strategy in mind, then, epistemologists who are fallibilists tend not to embrace skepticism.

Nor (if section 8 is right) should they do so. That section reported (i) the two reasons most commonly thought to show that fallibility in one’s support for a belief is not good enough if the belief is to be knowledge, along with (ii) the explanations of why (according to most epistemologists) those reasons mentioned in (i) are not good enough to entail their intended result. Given (ii), therefore, (i) will at least fail to give us infallible justification for thinking that fallible knowledge is not possible. Accordingly, perhaps such knowledge is possible. But if it is, then what form would it take?

Almost all epistemologists will adopt this generic conception of it:

Any instance of fallible knowledge is a true belief which is at least fallibly (and less than infallibly) justified.

(And remember that F*, in section 4, gave us some sense of what fallible justification is.) Let us call this the Fallible Knowledge Thesis. It is an application, to fallible knowledge in particular, of what is commonly called the Justified-True-Belief Analysis of Knowledge. (For an overview of that sort of analysis, see Hetherington 1996.) As stated, the Fallible Knowledge Thesis is quite general, in that it says almost nothing about what specific forms the justification within knowledge might take; all that it does require is that the justification would provide only fallible support.

Nonetheless, generic though it is, the question still arises of whether the Fallible Knowledge Thesis is ever satisfiable, let alone actually satisfied. And that question readily leads into this more specific one: Can a true belief ever be knowledge without having its truth entailed by the justification which is contributing to making the belief knowledge? (Sometimes this talk of justification is replaced by references to warrant, where this designates the justification and/or anything else that is being said to be needed if a particular true belief is to be knowledge. For that use of the term “warrant,” see Plantinga 1993.) Section 8 has disposed of some objections to there being any fallible knowledge; and the previous paragraph has gestured at how — via the Justified-True-Belief Analysis — one might conceive of fallible knowledge. Nonetheless, there could be residual resistance to accepting that there can be fallible knowledge like that. Undoubtedly, some people will think, “There just seems to be something wrong with allowing a belief or claim to be knowledge when it could be mistaken.”

That residual resistance is not clearly decisive, though. It could well owe its existence to a failure to distinguish between two significantly different kinds of question. The first asks whether a particular belief, given the justification supporting it, is true (and thereby fallible knowledge). The other question asks whether, given that belief’s being true, there is enough supporting justification in order for it to be (fallible) knowledge. The former question is raised from “within” a particular inquiry into the truth of a particular belief. The latter question arises from “outside” that inquiry into that belief’s being true (even if this question is arising within another inquiry, perhaps an epistemological one). There is no epistemologically standard way of designating the relevant difference between those kinds of question. Perhaps the following is a helpful way to clarify that difference.

(1) The not-necessarily-epistemological question as to whether a belief is true. Imagine trying to ascertain whether some actual or potential belief or claim is true. You ask yourself, say, “Do I know whether I passed that exam?” Suppose that you have good — fallibly good — evidence in favor of your having passed the exam. (You studied well. You concentrated hard. You felt confident. Your earlier marks in similar exams have been good.) And now suppose that you recall the Justified-True-Belief Analysis. You apply it to your case. What does it tell you? It tells you just that if your actual or possible belief (namely, the belief that you passed the exam) is true, then — given your having fallibly good evidence supporting the belief — the belief is or would be knowledge, albeit fallible knowledge. But does this reasoning tell you whether the belief is knowledge? It does not. All that you have been given is this conditional result: If your belief is true, then (given the justification you have in support of it) the belief is also knowledge. You have no means other than your justification, though, of determining whether the belief is true; and because the justification is fallible, it gives you no guarantee of the belief’s being true (and thereby of being knowledge). Moreover, if fallibilism is true, then any justification which you might have, no matter how extensive or detailed it is, would not save you from that plight. Thus (given fallibilism), you are trapped in the situation of being able to reach, at best, the following conclusion: “Because my evidence provides fallible justification for my belief, the belief is fallible knowledge if it is true.” At which point, most probably, you will wonder, “Is it true? That’s what I still don’t know. (I have no other way of knowing it to be true.)” And so — right there and then — you are denying that your belief is knowledge, because you are denying that you know it to be true. The fallibility in your justification leaves you dissatisfied, as an inquirer into the truth of a particular belief, at the idea of allowing that it could be knowledge, even fallible knowledge. When still inquiring into the truth of a particular belief, it is natural for you to deny that (even if, as it happens, the belief is true) your having fallible justification is enough to make the belief knowledge.

(2) The epistemological question as to whether a belief is knowledge. But the epistemologist’s question (asked at the start of this section) as to whether there can be fallible knowledge is not asked from the sort of inquirer’s perspective described in (1). The epistemologist is not asking whether your particular belief is true (while noting the justification you have for the belief). That is the question you are restricted to asking, when you are proceeding as the inquirer in (1). The epistemological question is subtly different. It does not imagine a fallibly justified belief — before asking, without making any actual or hypothetical commitment as to the belief’s truth, whether the belief is knowledge. Rather, the epistemologist’s question considers the conceptual combination of the belief plus the justification for it plus the belief’s being true — which is to say, the whole package that, in this case, is deemed by the Justified-True-Belief Analysis to be knowledge — before proceeding to ask whether this entirety is an instance of knowledge. To put that observation more simply, this epistemological question asks whether a belief which is fallibly justified, and which is true, is (fallible) knowledge. This is the question of whether your belief is knowledge, given (even if only for argument’s sake) that it is true. In (1), your focus was different to that. In wondering whether you had passed the exam, you were asking whether the belief is true: you were still leaving open the issue of whether or not the belief is true. And, as you realized, your fallible justification was also leaving open that question. For it left open the possibility of the belief’s falsity.

Consequently, from (1), it is obvious why an inquirer might want infallibility in her justification for a belief’s truth. Infallibility would mean her not having to leave open the question of the belief’s truth. Without infallibility, the possibility is left open by her justification (which is her only indication of whether her belief is true) of her belief being false — and hence not knowledge. (This is so, even if we demand that, in order for an inquirer’s belief to be knowledge, she has to know that it is. That demand is called the KK-thesis (with its most influential analysis and defense coming from Hintikka 1962: ch. 5) — because one’s having a piece of knowledge is taken to require one’s Knowing that one has that Knowledge. Yet even satisfying that demand does not remove the rational doubt described in (1). If the extra knowledge — the knowledge of the initial belief’s being knowledge — is not required to be infallible itself, then scope for doubt will remain as to whether the initial belief really is knowledge.) But if we can either (i) know or (ii) suppose (for the sake of another kind of inquiry) that the belief is true, then we may switch our perspective, so as to be asking a different question. That is what the epistemologist is doing in (2), by adopting the latter, (ii), of these two options. She supposes, for the sake of argument, that the belief is true; then she can ask, “Would the belief’s being both true and fallibly justified suffice for it to be knowledge?” She can do this without knowing at all, let alone infallibly, whether the belief is true. (She will also not know infallibly, at least not via this questioning, whether the belief is knowledge. Yet what else is to be expected if fallibilism is true?)

It is also obvious, from (1), why an inquirer might want infallibility in her justification, insofar as she is wondering whether to say or claim that some actual or potential belief of hers is knowledge. Nonetheless, this does not entail her needing such justification if her belief is to be knowledge. Remember — from (2) in section 8 — that whether one has a specific piece of knowledge could be quite a different matter to whether one may properly claim to have it. Similarly, most epistemologists will advise us not to confuse what makes a belief knowledge with what rationally assures someone that her belief is knowledge. For example, it is possible — according to fallibilist epistemologists in general — for a person to have some fallible knowledge, even if she does not know infallibly which of her beliefs attain that status.

This section began by asking the epistemological question of whether there can be fallible knowledge. And with our having seen — in this section’s (2) — what that question is actually asking, along with — in this section’s (1) — what it is not asking, we should end the section by acknowledging that, in asking that epistemological question, we need not be crediting epistemological observers with having a special insight into whether, in general, people’s beliefs are true. The question of whether those beliefs are true is not the question being posed by the epistemological observer. She is asking whether a particular belief is knowledge, given (even if only for argument’s sake) that it is true and fallibly justified. She is asking this from “above” or “outside” the various “lower level” or “inner” attempts to know whether the given beliefs are true. The other (“lower level”) inquirers, in contrast, are asking whether their fallibly justified beliefs are true. There is fallibility in each of those processes of questioning; they just happen to have somewhat different subject-matters and methods.

We should not leave a discussion of the Fallible Knowledge Thesis without observing that, even if it is correct in its general thrust, epistemologists have faced severe challenges in their attempts to complete its details — to make it more precise and less generic. Over the past forty or so years, there have been many such attempts. But these have encountered one problem after another, mostly as epistemologists have struggled to solve what is often called the Gettier Problem.

A very brief word on that problem is in order here. It has become the epistemological challenge of defining knowledge precisely, so as to understand all actual or possible cases of knowledge — where one of the project’s guiding assumptions has been that it is possible for instances of knowledge to involve justification which supplies only fallible support. In other words, the project has striven to find a precise analysis of what the Fallible Knowledge Thesis would deem to be fallible knowledge; and, unfortunately, the Gettier Problem is generally thought by epistemologists still to be awaiting a definitive solution. Such a solution would determine wholly and exactly how fallible a particular justified true belief can be, and in what specific ways it can be fallible, without that justified true belief failing to be knowledge. In the meantime (while awaiting that sort of solution), epistemologists incline towards accepting the Justified-True-Belief Analysis — represented here in the Fallible Knowledge Thesis — as being at least approximately correct. Certainly in practice, most epistemologists treat the analysis as being correct enough — so that it functions well as giving us a concept of knowledge that is adequate to whatever demands we would place upon a concept of knowledge within most of the contexts where we need a concept of knowledge at all. Such epistemologists take the difficulties that have been encountered in the attempts to ascertain exactly how a fallibly justified true belief can manage to be knowledge as being difficulties of mere (and maybe less important) detail, not ones of insuperable and vital principle. Those epistemologists tend to assume that eventually the needed details will emerge, that these will be agreed upon by epistemologists, and hence that the basic idea behind the Fallible Knowledge Thesis will finally and definitively be vindicated. (For more on the history of that epistemological project, see Shope 1983.)

But again, that definitive vindication is yet to be achieved. And, of course, it will not eventuate if we should be answering “No” to the question (discussed earlier in this section) of whether a true belief which is less than infallibly justified is able to be knowledge. When there is fallibility in the justification for a particular true belief, is this fact already sufficient to prevent that belief from being knowledge? Few epistemologists wish to believe so. What we have found in this section is that they are at least not obviously mistaken in that optimistic interpretation.

10. Implications of Fallibilism: No Justification?

Sometimes epistemologists believe that fallibilism opens the door upon an even more striking worry than the one discussed in section 9 (namely, the possibility of there being no knowledge, due to the impossibility of knowledge’s ever being fallible). Sometimes they infer, from the presence of fallibility, that even justification (let alone knowledge) is absent. That is, once fallibility enters, even justification — all justification — departs. Consequently, those epistemologists — once they accept that a universal fallibilism obtains — are skeptics even about the existence of justification. (For an example of such an approach, see Miller 1994: ch. 3.)

How would that interpretation of the impact of fallibilism be articulated? In effect, the idea is that if evidence, say, is to provide even good (let alone very good or excellent or perfect) guidance as to which beliefs are true, it is not allowed to be fallible. No justification worthy of the name is able to be merely fallible. And from that viewpoint, of course, skepticism beckons insofar as no one is ever capable of having any infallible justification. If fallibility is rampant, yet infallibility is required if evidence or the like is ever to be supplying real justification, then no real justification is ever supplied. In short, no beliefs are ever justified.

That is a wholly general skepticism about justification, emerging from a wholly general fallibilism. A possible example of that form of skepticism would be the one with which Descartes ended his Meditation I. Cartesian evil genius skepticism would say that, because there is always the possibility of Descartes’ evil genius (in section 7) controlling our minds, any evidence or reasoning that one ever has could be a result just of the evil genius’s hidden intrusion into one’s mind. The evil genius — by making everything within one’s mind false and misleading — could render false all of one’s evidence, along with all of one’s ideas as to what is good reasoning. None of one’s evidence, and none of one’s beliefs as to how to use that evidence, would be true. However, if there were no truth anywhere in one’s thinking (with one never realizing this), then no components of one’s thinking would be truth-indicative or truth-conducive. No part of one’s thinking would ever lead one to have an accurate belief. Continually, one would both begin and end with falsity. And there are many epistemologists in whose estimation this would mean that no part of one’s thinking is ever really justifying some other part of one’s thinking. For justification is usually supposed to have some relevant link to truth. And presumably there would be no such link, if every single element in one’s thinking is misleading — as would be the case if an evil genius was at work. Is that possible, then? Moreover, is it so dramatic a possibility that if we are forever unable to prove that it is absent, then our minds will never contain real justification for even some of our beliefs?

A potentially less general skepticism about justification would be a Humean inductive skepticism (mentioned in section 6). The thinking behind this sort of skepticism infers — from the inherent fallibility of any inductive extrapolations that could be made from some observations — that no such extrapolation is ever even somewhat rational or justifying. Again, the skeptical interpretation of Humean inductive fallibilism is that, given that all possible extrapolations from observations are fallible, neither logic nor any other form of reason can favor one particular extrapolation over another. The fallibilism implies that there is fallibility within any extrapolation: none are immune. And the would-be skeptic infers from this that, once there is such widespread fallibility, there may as well be a complete absence of any pretence at rationality. The fallibility will be inescapable, even as we seek to defend the rationality of one extrapolation over another. Why is that? Well, we could mount such a defense only by pointing to one sort of extrapolation’s possessing a better past record of predictive success, say. But we would be pointing to that better past record, only in order to infer that such an extrapolation is more trustworthy on the present occasion. And that inference would itself be an inductive extrapolation. It, too, is therefore fallible. Accordingly, if there was previously a need to overcome inductive fallibility (with this need being the reason for consulting the past records of success in the first place), then there remains such a need, even after past records of success have been consulted. In this way, it is the fallibility’s inescapability that generates the skepticism.

Yet, as we noted earlier, most epistemologists would wish to evade or undermine skeptical arguments such as those ones — arguments that seek to convert a kind of fallibilism into a corresponding skepticism. How might this non-skeptical maneuver be achieved? There has been a plethora of attempts, too many to mention here. (For one survey, see Rescher 1980.) Moreover, no consensus has developed on how to escape skeptical arguments like these. That issue is beyond the scope of this article.

What may usefully (even if generically) be described here, however, is a fundamental choice as to how to interpret the force of fallibilism within our cognitive lives. Any response to the skeptical challenges will make that choice (even if usually implicitly and in some more specific way). The basic choice will be between the following two underlying pictures of what a wholly general fallibilism would tell us about ourselves:

(A) The inescapable fallibility of one’s cognitive efforts would be like the inescapable limits — whatever, precisely, these are — upon one’s bodily muscles. These limit what one’s body is capable of — while nonetheless being part of how it achieves whatever it does achieve. Inescapable fallibility would thus be like a background limitation — always present, sometimes a source of frustration, but rarely a danger. When used appropriately, muscles strengthen themselves in accomplished yet limited ways. Would the constant presence of fallibility be like a (fallibly) self-correcting mechanism?

(B) Inescapable fallibility would be like a debilitating illness which “feeds upon” itself. It would become ever more dangerous, as its impact is compounded by repeated use. This would badly lower the quality of one’s thinking. (For a model of that process, notice how easily instances of minor fallibility can interact so as to lead to major fallibility. For example, a sequence in which one slightly fallible piece of evidence after another is used as support for the next can end up providing very weak — overly fallible — support: [80%-probabilification X 80%-probabilification X 80%-probabilification X 80%-probabilification]

How are we to choose between (A) and (B) — between the Limited Muscles model of fallibilism and the Debilitating Illness model of it?

Because most epistemologists are non-skeptics, they favor (A) — the Limited Muscles model. This is not to insist that thinking in an (A)-influenced way is bound to succeed against skeptical arguments. The point right now is simply that this way of thinking is one possible goal for an epistemologist. It is the goal of finding some means of successfully understanding and defending an instance of the Limited Muscles model. What is described by that model would be such a theorist’s desired way to conceive, if this is possible, of the general idea of inescapable fallibility. She will seek to conceive of inescapable fallibility as being manageable, even useful. Hence, the Limited Muscles model is a framework which — in extremely general terms — she will hope allows her to understand — in more specific terms — the nature and significance of fallibilism. Perhaps the most influential modern example of this approach was Quine’s (1969), centered upon a famous metaphor from Neurath (1959 [1932/33], sec. 201). That metaphor portrays human cognitive efforts as akin to a boat, afloat at sea. The boat has its own sorts of fallibility. It is subject to stresses and cracks. And how worrying is that? Must the boat sink whenever those weaknesses manifest themselves? No, because that is not how boats usually function. In general, repairs can be made. This may occur even while the boat is still at sea. Structurally, it is strong enough to support repairs to itself, even as it continues being used, even while making progress towards its destination. Neurath regarded cognitive progress as being like that — as did Quine, who further developed Neurath’s model. On what Quine called his "naturalized" conception of epistemology (a conception that many subsequent thinkers have sought to make more detailed and to apply more widely), human observation and reason make cognitive progress in spite of their fallibility. They do so, even when discovering their own fallibility — finding their own stresses and cracks. Must they then sink, floundering in futility? No. They continue being used, often while repairing their own stresses and cracks — reliably correcting their own deliverances and predictions. Section 5 asked whether science is an especially fallible method. As was also noted, though, science provides impressive results. Indeed, it was Quine’s favored example of large-scale cognitive progress. How can that occur? How can scientific claims — including so many striking ones — be justified, in spite of the fallibility that remains? Maybe science is like a ship that carries within it some skilled and imaginative artisans (carpenters, welders, electricians, and the like). Not only can it survive; it can become more grand and capable when being repaired at sea. (Even so, is such cognitive progress best described in probabilistic terms? On that possibility, implied by Humean fallibilism, see Howson 2000.)

Naturally, in contrast to that optimistic model for thinking about fallible justification, skeptics will prefer (B) — the Debilitating Illness model. We have examined (in sections 6 and 7) a couple of specific ways in which they might try to instantiate that general model. We have also seen (in sections 8 through 10) some reasons why those skeptics might not be right. Perhaps they overstate the force of fallibilism — inferring too much from the facts of fallibility. In any case, the present point is that skeptics (like non-skeptics) seek specific arguments in pursuit of a successful articulation and defense of an underlying picture of inescapable fallibility. Both skeptics and non-skeptics thereby search for an understanding of fallibilism’s nature and significance. They simply reach for opposed conceptions of what fallibilism implies about people’s ability to observe and to reason justifiably.

So, there is a substantial choice to be made; and each of us makes it, more or less carefully and consciously, when reflecting upon these topics. Which of those two basic interpretive directions, then, should we follow? The intellectual implications of this difficult choice are exhilaratingly deep.

11. References and Further Reading

  • Baldwin, T. G. E. Moore. London: Routledge, 1990. 226-32.
    • On Moore’s paradox.
  • Buckle, S. Hume’s Enlightenment Tract: The Unity and Purpose of An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001. Part 2, chapter 4.
    • On Hume’s famous skeptical reasoning in his first Enquiry.
  • Conee, E. and Feldman, R. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004.
    • A traditional (and popular) approach to understanding the nature of epistemic justification.
  • Curley, E. M. Descartes against the Skeptics. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1978.
    • On Descartes’ skeptical doubting.
  • Descartes, R. The Philosophical Works of Descartes, Vol. I, (eds. and trans.) E. S. Haldane and G. R. T. Ross. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1911 [1641].
    • Contains both the Discourse and the Meditations. These include both the Evil Genius argument and the Cogito.
  • Feldman, R. “Fallibilism and Knowing That One Knows.” The Philosophical Review 90 (1981): 266-82.
    • On the nature and availability of fallible knowledge.
  • Goldman, A. I. “What is Justified Belief?” In G. S. Pappas (ed.), Justification and Knowledge: New Studies in Epistemology. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1979.
    • An influential analysis of the nature of epistemic justification.
  • Hetherington, S. Knowledge Puzzles: An Introduction to Epistemology. Boulder, Colo.: Westview Press, 1996.
    • Includes an overview of many of the commonly noticed difficulties posed by the Gettier problem for our attaining a full understanding of fallible knowledge.
  • Hetherington, S. “Knowing Fallibly.” Journal of Philosophy 96 (1999): 565-87.
    • Describes the genus of which fallible knowledge is a species.
  • Hetherington, S. “Fallibilism and Knowing That One Is Not Dreaming.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 32 (2002): 83-102.
    • Shows how fallibilism need not lead to skepticism about knowledge.
  • Hintikka, J. Knowledge and Belief: An Introduction to the Logic of the Two Notions Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1962. ch. 5.
    • On the KK-thesis — that is, on knowing that one knows.
  • Howson, C. Hume’s Problem: Induction and the Justification of Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • A technically detailed response to Hume’s fallibilist challenge to the possibility of inductively justified belief.
  • Hume, D. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, in Hume’s Enquiries, (ed.) L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd edn. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1902 [1748].
    • This includes, in section IV, the most generally cited version of Hume’s inductive fallibilism and inductive skepticism.
  • Kahneman, D., Slovic, P., and Tversky, A. (eds.). Judgment under Uncertainty: Heuristics and Biases. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982.
    • On empirical evidence of people’s cognitive fallibilities.
  • Merricks, T. “More on Warrant’s Entailing Truth.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 57 (1997): 627-31.
    • Argues against the possibility of there being fallible knowledge.
  • Miller, D. Critical Rationalism: A Restatement and Defence. Chicago: Open Court, 1994.
    • Discusses many ideas (including a skepticism about epistemic justification) that might arise if fallibilism is true.
  • Morton, A. A Guide through the Theory of Knowledge, 3rd edn. Malden, Mass.: Blackwell, 2003. ch. 5.
    • On the basic idea, plus some possible forms, of fallibilism.
  • Nagel, T. The View from Nowhere. New York: Oxford University Press, 1986.
    • See especially chapters I and V. Discusses the interplay of different perspectives (“inner” and “outer” ones) that a person might seek upon herself, especially as greater objectivity is sought. (This bears upon section 9’s distinction between two possible kinds of question that can be asked about whether a particular belief is fallible knowledge.)
  • Neurath, O. “Protocol Sentences,” in A. J. Ayer (ed.), Logical Positivism. Glencoe, Ill.: The Free Press, 1959 [1932/33].
    • Includes the famous “boat at sea” metaphor.
  • Nisbett, R. and Ross, L. Human Inference: Strategies and Shortcomings of Social Judgment. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall, 1980.
    • On empirical evidence of people’s cognitive fallibilities.
  • Peirce, C. S. Collected Papers, (eds.) C. Hartshorne and P. Weiss. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1931-60.
    • See, for example, 1.120, and 1.141 through 1.175, for some of Peirce’s originating articulation of the concept of fallibilism as such.
  • Plantinga, A. Warrant: The Current Debate. New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
    • An analysis of some proposals as to what warrant might be within (fallible) knowledge.
  • Quine, W. V. “Epistemology Naturalized,” in Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. New York: Columbia University Press, 1969.
    • A bold and prominent statement of the program of naturalized epistemology, trying to understand fallibility as a part of, rather than a threat to, the justified uses of observation and reason.
  • Reed, B. “How to Think about Fallibilism.” Philosophical Studies 107 (2002): 143-57.
    • An attempt to define fallible knowledge.
  • Rescher, N. Scepticism: A Critical Reappraisal. Oxford: Blackwell, 1980.
    • On fallibilism and many associated skeptical issues about knowledge and justification.
  • Shope, R. K. The Analysis of Knowing: A Decade of Research Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983.
    • Presents much of the earlier history of attempts to solve the Gettier problem — and thereby to define fallible knowledge.
  • Sorensen, R. A. Blindspots. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1988. ch. 1.
    • A philosophical analysis of the kinds of thought or sentence that constitute Moore’s paradox.
  • Stove, D. C. Probability and Hume’s Inductive Scepticism. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1973.
    • Explains how Hume’s inductive fallibilism gives way to his inductive skepticism.
  • Williams, B. Descartes: The Project of Pure Enquiry. Hassocks: The Harvester Press, 1978.
    • Analysis of Descartes’ skeptical doubts.
  • Wilson, M. D. Descartes. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1978.
    • Includes an account of Descartes’ skeptical endeavors.
  • Wittgenstein, L. Philosophical Investigations, (trans.) G. E. M. Anscombe. Oxford: Blackwell, 1978 [1953]. Sections 243-315, 348-412.
    • Presents the private language argument (against the possibility of anyone’s being able to think in a language which only they could understand).

Author Information

Stephen Hetherington
University of New South Wales

Gettier Problems

Gettier Problems

GettierGettier problems or cases are named in honor of the American philosopher Edmund Gettier, who discovered them in 1963. They function as challenges to the philosophical tradition of defining knowledge of a proposition as justified true belief in that proposition. The problems are actual or possible situations in which someone has a belief that is both true and well supported by evidence, yet which — according to almost all epistemologists — fails to be knowledge. Gettier’s original article had a dramatic impact, as epistemologists began trying to ascertain afresh what knowledge is, with almost all agreeing that Gettier had refuted the traditional definition of knowledge. They have made many attempts to repair or replace that traditional definition of knowledge, resulting in several new conceptions of knowledge and of justificatory support. In this respect, Gettier sparked a period of pronounced epistemological energy and innovation — all with a single two-and-a-half page article. There is no consensus, however, that any one of the attempts to solve the Gettier challenge has succeeded in fully defining what it is to have knowledge of a truth or fact. So, the force of that challenge continues to be felt in various ways, and to various extents, within epistemology. Sometimes, the challenge is ignored in frustration at the existence of so many possibly failed efforts to solve it. Often, the assumption is made that somehow it can — and will, one of these days — be solved. Usually, it is agreed to show something about knowledge, even if not all epistemologists concur as to exactly what it shows.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Justified-True-Belief Analysis of Knowledge
  3. Gettier’s Original Challenge
  4. Some other Gettier Cases
  5. The Basic Structure of Gettier Cases
  6. The Generality of Gettier Cases
  7. Attempted Solutions: Infallibility
  8. Attempted Solutions: Eliminating Luck
  9. Attempted Solutions: Eliminating False Evidence
  10. Attempted Solutions: Eliminating Defeat
  11. Attempted Solutions: Eliminating Inappropriate Causality
  12. Attempted Dissolutions: Competing Intuitions
  13. Attempted Dissolutions: Knowing Luckily
  14. Gettier Cases and Analytic Epistemology
  15. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Gettier problems or cases arose as a challenge to our understanding of the nature of knowledge. Initially, that challenge appeared in an article by Edmund Gettier, published in 1963. But his article had a striking impact among epistemologists, so much so that hundreds of subsequent articles and sections of books have generalized Gettier’s original idea into a more wide-ranging concept of a Gettier case or problem, where instances of this concept might differ in many ways from Gettier’s own cases. Philosophers swiftly became adept at thinking of variations on Gettier’s own particular cases; and, over the years, this fecundity has been taken to render his challenge even more significant. This is especially so, given that there has been no general agreement on how to solve the challenge posed by Gettier cases as a group — Gettier’s own ones or those that other epistemologists have observed or imagined. (Note that sometimes this general challenge is called the Gettier problem.) What, then, is the nature of knowledge? And can we rigorously define what it is to know? Gettier’s article gave to these questions a precision and urgency that they had formerly lacked. The questions are still being debated — more or less fervently at different times — within post-Gettier epistemology.

2. The Justified-True-Belief Analysis of Knowledge

Gettier cases are meant to challenge our understanding of propositional knowledge. This is knowledge which is described by phrases of the form “knowledge that p,” with “p” being replaced by some indicative sentence (such as “Kangaroos have no wings”). It is knowledge of a truth or fact — knowledge of how the world is in whatever respect is being described by a given occurrence of “p”. Usually, when epistemologists talk simply of knowledge they are referring to propositional knowledge. It is a kind of knowledge which we attribute to ourselves routinely and fundamentally.

Hence, it is philosophically important to ask what, more fully, such knowledge is. If we do not fully understand what it is, will we not fully understand ourselves either? That is a possibility, as philosophers have long realized. Those questions are ancient ones; in his own way, Plato asked them.

And, prior to Gettier’s challenge, different epistemologists would routinely have offered in reply some more or less detailed and precise version of the following generic three-part analysis of what it is for a person to have knowledge that p (for any particular “p”):

  1. Belief. The person believes that p. This belief might be more or less confident. And it might — but it need not — be manifested in the person’s speech, such as by her saying that p or by her saying that she believes that p. All that is needed, strictly speaking, is for her belief to exist (while possessing at least the two further properties that are about to be listed).
  2. Truth. The person’s belief that p needs to be true. If it is incorrect instead, then — no matter what else is good or useful about it — it is not knowledge. It would only be something else, something lesser. Admittedly, even when a belief is mistaken it can feel to the believer as if it is true. But in that circumstance the feeling would be mistaken; and so the belief would not be knowledge, no matter how much it might feel to the believer like knowledge.
  3. Justification. The person’s belief that p needs to be well supported, such as by being based upon some good evidence or reasoning, or perhaps some other kind of rational justification. Otherwise, the belief, even if it is true, may as well be a lucky guess. It would be correct without being knowledge. It would only be something else, something lesser.

Supposedly (on standard pre-Gettier epistemology), each of those three conditions needs to be satisfied, if there is to be knowledge; and, equally, if all are satisfied together, the result is an instance of knowledge. In other words, the analysis presents what it regards as being three individually necessary, and jointly sufficient, kinds of condition for having an instance of knowledge that p.

The analysis is generally called the justified-true-belief form of analysis of knowledge (or, for short, JTB). For instance, your knowing that you are a person would be your believing (as you do) that you are one, along with this belief’s being true (as it is) and its resting (as it does) upon much good evidence. That evidence will probably include such matters as your having been told that you are a person, your having reflected upon what it is to be a person, your seeing relevant similarities between yourself and other persons, and so on.

It is important to bear in mind that JTB, as presented here, is a generic analysis. It is intended to describe a general structuring which can absorb or generate comparatively specific analyses that might be suggested, either of all knowledge at once or of particular kinds of knowledge. It provides a basic outline — a form — of a theory. In practice, epistemologists would suggest further details, while respecting that general form. So, even when particular analyses suggested by particular philosophers at first glance seem different to JTB, these analyses can simply be more specific instances or versions of that more general form of theory.

Probably the most common way for this to occur involves the specific analyses incorporating, in turn, further analyses of some or all of belief, truth, and justification. For example, some of the later sections in this article may be interpreted as discussing attempts to understand justification more precisely, along with how it functions as part of knowledge. In general, the goal of such attempts can be that of ascertaining aspects of knowledge’s microstructure, thereby rendering the general theory JTB as precise and full as it needs to be in order genuinely to constitute an understanding of particular instances of knowing and of not knowing. Steps in that direction by various epistemologists have tended to be more detailed and complicated after Gettier’s 1963 challenge than had previously been the case. Roderick Chisholm (1966/1977/1989) was an influential exemplar of the post-1963 tendency; A. J. Ayer (1956) famously exemplified the pre-1963 approach.

3. Gettier’s Original Challenge

Gettier’s article described two possible situations. This section presents his Case I. (It is perhaps the more widely discussed of the two. The second will be mentioned in the next section.) Subsequent sections will use this Case I of Gettier’s as a focal point for analysis.

The case’s protagonist is Smith. He and Jones have applied for a particular job. But Smith has been told by the company president that Jones will win the job. Smith combines that testimony with his observational evidence of there being ten coins in Jones’s pocket. (He had counted them himself — an odd but imaginable circumstance.) And he proceeds to infer that whoever will get the job has ten coins in their pocket. (As the present article proceeds, we will refer to this belief several times more. For convenience, therefore, let us call it belief b.) Notice that Smith is not thereby guessing. On the contrary; his belief b enjoys a reasonable amount of justificatory support. There is the company president’s testimony; there is Smith’s observation of the coins in Jones’s pocket; and there is Smith’s proceeding to infer belief b carefully and sensibly from that other evidence. Belief b is thereby at least fairly well justified — supported by evidence which is good in a reasonably normal way. As it happens, too, belief b is true — although not in the way in which Smith was expecting it to be true. For it is Smith who will get the job, and Smith himself has ten coins in his pocket. These two facts combine to make his belief b true. Nevertheless, neither of those facts is something that, on its own, was known by Smith. Is his belief b therefore not knowledge? In other words, does Smith fail to know that the person who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket? Surely so (thought Gettier).

That is Gettier’s Case I, as it was interpreted by him, and as it has subsequently been regarded by almost all other epistemologists. The immediately pertinent aspects of it are standardly claimed to be as follows. It contains a belief which is true and justified — but which is not knowledge. And if that is an accurate reading of the case, then JTB is false. Case I would show that it is possible for a belief to be true and justified without being knowledge. Case I would have established that the combination of truth, belief, and justification does not entail the presence of knowledge. In that sense, a belief’s being true and justified would not be sufficient for its being knowledge.

But if JTB is false as it stands, with what should it be replaced? (Gettier himself made no suggestions about this.) Its failing to describe a jointly sufficient condition of knowing does not entail that the three conditions it does describe are not individually necessary to knowing. And if each of truth, belief, and justification is needed, then what aspect of knowledge is still missing? What feature of Case I prevents Smith’s belief b from being knowledge? What is the smallest imaginable alteration to the case that would allow belief b to become knowledge? Would we need to add some wholly new kind of element to the situation? Or is JTB false only because it is too general — too unspecific? For instance, are only some kinds of justification both needed and enough, if a true belief is to become knowledge? Must we describe more specifically how justification ever makes a true belief knowledge? Is Smith’s belief b justified in the wrong way, if it is to be knowledge?

4. Some other Gettier Cases

Having posed those questions, though, we should realize that they are merely representative of a more general epistemological line of inquiry. The epistemological challenge is not just to discover the minimal repair that we could make to Gettier’s Case I, say, so that knowledge would then be present. Rather, it is to find a failing — a reason for a lack of knowledge — that is common to all Gettier cases that have been, or could be, thought of (that is, all actual or possible cases relevantly like Gettier’s own ones). Only thus will we be understanding knowledge in general — all instances of knowledge, everyone’s knowledge. And this is our goal when responding to Gettier cases.

Sections 7 through 11 will present some attempted diagnoses of such cases. In order to evaluate them, therefore, it would be advantageous to have some sense of the apparent potential range of the concept of a Gettier case. I will mention four notable cases.

The lucky disjunction (Gettier’s second case: 1963). Again, Smith is the protagonist. This time, he possesses good evidence in favor of the proposition that Jones owns a Ford. Smith also has a friend, Brown. Where is Brown to be found at the moment? Smith does not know. Nonetheless, on the basis of his accepting that Jones owns a Ford, he infers — and accepts — each of these three disjunctive propositions:

  • Either Jones owns a Ford, or Brown is in Boston.
  • Either Jones owns a Ford, or Brown is in Barcelona.
  • Either Jones owns a Ford, or Brown is in Brest-Litovsk.

No insight into Brown’s location guides Smith in any of this reasoning. He realizes that he has good evidence for the first disjunct (regarding Jones) in each of those three disjunctions, and he sees this evidence as thereby supporting each disjunction as a whole. Seemingly, he is right about that. (These are inclusive disjunctions, not exclusive. That is, each can, if need be, accommodate the truth of both of its disjuncts. Each is true if even one — let alone both — of its disjuncts is true.) Moreover, in fact one of the three disjunctions is true (albeit in a way that would surprise Smith if he were to be told of how it is true). The second disjunction is true because, as good luck would have it, Brown is in Barcelona — even though, as bad luck would have it, Jones does not own a Ford. (As it happened, the evidence for his doing so, although good, was misleading.) Accordingly, Smith’s belief that either Jones owns a Ford or Brown is in Barcelona is true. And there is good evidence supporting — justifying — it. But is it knowledge?

The sheep in the field (Chisholm 1966/1977/1989). Imagine that you are standing outside a field. You see, within it, what looks exactly like a sheep. What belief instantly occurs to you? Among the many that could have done so, it happens to be the belief that there is a sheep in the field. And in fact you are right, because there is a sheep behind the hill in the middle of the field. You cannot see that sheep, though, and you have no direct evidence of its existence. Moreover, what you are seeing is a dog, disguised as a sheep. Hence, you have a well justified true belief that there is a sheep in the field. But is that belief knowledge?

The pyromaniac (Skyrms 1967). A pyromaniac reaches eagerly for his box of Sure-Fire matches. He has excellent evidence of the past reliability of such matches, as well as of the present conditions — the clear air and dry matches — being as they should be, if his aim of lighting one of the matches is to be satisfied. He thus has good justification for believing, of the particular match he proceeds to pluck from the box, that it will light. This is what occurs, too: the match does light. However, what the pyromaniac did not realize is that there were impurities in this specific match, and that it would not have lit if not for the sudden (and rare) jolt of Q-radiation it receives exactly when he is striking it. His belief is therefore true and well justified. But is it knowledge?

The fake barns (Goldman 1976). Henry is driving in the countryside, looking at objects in fields. He sees what looks exactly like a barn. Accordingly, he thinks that he is seeing a barn. Now, that is indeed what he is doing. But what he does not realize is that the neighborhood contains many fake barns — mere barn facades that look like real barns when viewed from the road. And if he had been looking at one of them, he would have been deceived into believing that he was seeing a barn. Luckily, he was not doing this. Consequently, his belief is justified and true. But is it knowledge?

In none of those cases (or relevantly similar ones), say almost all epistemologists, is the belief in question knowledge. (Note that some epistemologists do not regard the fake barns case as being a genuine Gettier case. There is a touch of vagueness in the concept of a Gettier case.)

5. The Basic Structure of Gettier Cases

Although the multitude of actual and possible Gettier cases differ in their details, some characteristics unite them. For a start, each Gettier case contains a belief which is true and well justified without — according to epistemologists as a whole — being knowledge. The following two generic features also help to constitute Gettier cases:

  1. Fallibility. The justification that is present within each case is fallible. Although it provides good support for the truth of the belief in question, that support is not perfect, strictly speaking. This means that the justification leaves open at least the possibility of the belief’s being false. The justification indicates strongly that the belief is true — without proving conclusively that it is.
  2. Luck. What is most distinctive of Gettier cases is the luck they contain. Within any Gettier case, in fact the well-but-fallibly justified belief in question is true. Nevertheless, there is significant luck in how the belief manages to combine being true with being justified. Some abnormal or odd circumstance is present in the case, a circumstance which makes the existence of that justified and true belief quite fortuitous.

Here is how those two features, (1) and (2), are instantiated in Gettier’s Case I. Smith’s evidence for his belief b was good but fallible. This left open the possibility of belief b being mistaken, even given that supporting evidence. As it happened, that possibility was not realized: Smith’s belief b was actually true. Yet this was due to the intervention of some good luck. Belief b could easily have been false; it was made true only by circumstances which were hidden from Smith. That is, belief b was in fact made true by circumstances (namely, Smith’s getting the job and there being ten coins in his pocket) other than those which Smith’s evidence noticed and which his evidence indicated as being a good enough reason for holding b to be true. What Smith thought were the circumstances (concerning Jones) making his belief b true were nothing of the sort. Luckily, though, some facts of which he had no inkling were making his belief true.

Similar remarks pertain to the sheep-in-the-field case. Within it, your sensory evidence is good. You rely on your senses, taking for granted — as one normally would — that the situation is normal. Then, by standard reasoning, you gain a true belief (that there is a sheep in the field) on the basis of that fallible-but-good evidence. Nonetheless, wherever there is fallibility there is a chance of being mistaken — of gaining a belief which is false. And that is exactly what would have occurred in this case (given that you are actually looking at a disguised dog) — if not, luckily, for the presence behind the hill of the hidden real sheep. Only luckily, therefore, is your belief both justified and true. And because of that luck (say epistemologists in general), the belief fails to be knowledge.

6. The Generality of Gettier Cases

JTB says that any actual or possible case of knowledge that p is an actual or possible instance of some kind of well justified true belief that p — and that any actual or possible instance of some kind of well justified true belief that p is an actual or possible instance of knowledge that p. Hence, JTB is false if there is even one actual or possible Gettier situation (in which some justified true belief fails to be knowledge). Accordingly, since 1963 epistemologists have tried — again and again and again — to revise or repair or replace JTB in response to Gettier cases. The main aim has been to modify JTB so as to gain a ‘Gettier-proof’ definition of knowledge.

How extensive would such repairs need to be? After all, even if some justified true beliefs arise within Gettier situations, not all do so. In practise, such situations are rare, with few of our actual justified true beliefs ever being “Gettiered.” Has Gettier therefore shown only that not all justified true beliefs are knowledge? Correlatively, might JTB be almost correct as it is — in the sense of being accurate about almost all actual or possible cases of knowledge?

On the face of it, Gettier cases do indeed show only that not all actual or possible justified true beliefs are knowledge — rather than that a belief’s being justified and true is never enough for its being knowledge. Nevertheless, epistemologists generally report the impact of Gettier cases in the latter way, describing them as showing that being justified and true is never enough to make a belief knowledge. Why do epistemologists interpret the Gettier challenge in that stronger way?

The reason is that they wish — by way of some universally applicable definition or formula or analysis — to understand knowledge in all of its actual or possible instances and manifestations, not only in some of them. Hence, epistemologists strive to understand how to avoid ever being in a Gettier situation (from which knowledge will be absent, regardless of whether such situations are uncommon). But that goal is, equally, the aim of understanding what it is about most situations that constitutes their not being Gettier situations. If we do not know what, exactly, makes a situation a Gettier case and what changes to it would suffice for its no longer being a Gettier case, then we do not know how, exactly, to describe the boundary between Gettier cases and other situations.

We call various situations in which we form beliefs “everyday” or “ordinary,” for example. In particular, therefore, we might wonder whether all “normally” justified true beliefs are still instances of knowledge (even if in Gettier situations the justified true beliefs are not knowledge). Yet even that tempting idea is not as straightforward as we might have assumed. For do we know what it is, exactly, that makes a situation ordinary? Specifically, what are the details of ordinary situations that allow them not to be Gettier situations — and hence that allow them to contain knowledge? To the extent that we do not understand what it takes for a situation not to be a Gettier situation, we do not understand what it takes for a situation to be a normal one (thereby being able to contain knowledge). Understanding Gettier situations would be part of understanding non-Gettier situations — including ordinary situations. Until we adequately understand Gettier situations, we do not adequately understand ordinary situations — because we would not adequately understand the difference between these two kinds of situation.

7. Attempted Solutions: Infallibility

To the extent that we understand what makes something a Gettier case, we understand what would suffice for that situation not to be a Gettier case. Section 5 outlined two key components — fallibility and luck — of Gettier situations. In this section and the next, we will consider whether removing one of those two components — the removal of which will suffice for a situation’s no longer being a Gettier case — would solve Gettier’s epistemological challenge. That is, we will be asking whether we may come to understand the nature of knowledge by recognizing its being incompatible with the presence of at least one of those two components (fallibility and luck).

There is a prima facie case, at any rate, for regarding justificatory fallibility with concern in this setting. So, let us examine the Infallibility Proposal for solving Gettier’s challenge. There have long been philosophers who doubt (independently of encountering Gettier cases) that allowing fallible justification is all that it would take to convert a true belief into knowledge. (“If you know that p, there must have been no possibility of your being mistaken about p,” they might say.) The classic philosophical expression of that sort of doubt was by René Descartes, most famously in his Meditations on First Philosophy (1641). Contemporary epistemologists who have voiced similar doubts include Keith Lehrer (1971) and Peter Unger (1971). In the opinion of epistemologists who embrace the Infallibility Proposal, we can eliminate Gettier cases as challenges to our understanding of knowledge, simply by refusing to allow that one’s having fallible justification for a belief that p could ever adequately satisfy JTB’s justification condition. Stronger justification than that is required within knowledge (they will claim); infallibilist justificatory support is needed. (They might even say that there is no justification present at all, let alone an insufficient amount of it, given the fallibility within the cases.)

Thus, for instance, an infallibilist about knowledge might claim that because (in Case I) Smith’s justification provided only fallible support for his belief b, this justification was always leaving open the possibility of that belief being mistaken — and that this is why the belief is not knowledge. The infallibilist might also say something similar — as follows — about the sheep-in-the-field case. Because you were relying on your fallible senses in the first place, you were bound not to gain knowledge of there being a sheep in the field. (“It could never be real knowledge, given the inherent possibility of error in using one’s senses.”) And the infallibilist will regard the fake-barns case in the same way, claiming that the potential for mistake (that is, the existence of fallibility) was particularly real, due to the existence of the fake barns. And that is why (infers the infallibilist) there is a lack of knowledge within the case — as indeed there would be within any situation where fallible justification is being used.

So, that is the Infallibility Proposal. The standard epistemological objection to it is that it fails to do justice to the reality of our lives, seemingly as knowers of many aspects of the surrounding world. In our apparently “ordinary” situations, moving from one moment to another, we take ourselves to have much knowledge. Yet we rarely, if ever, possess infallible justificatory support for a belief. And we accept this about ourselves, realizing that we are not wholly — conclusively — reliable. We accept that if we are knowers, then, we are at least not infallible knowers. But the Infallibility Proposal — when combined with that acceptance of our general fallibility — would imply that we are not knowers at all. It would thereby ground a skepticism about our ever having knowledge.

Accordingly, most epistemologists would regard the Infallibility Proposal as being a drastic and mistaken reaction to Gettier’s challenge in particular. In response to Gettier, most seek to understand how we do have at least some knowledge — where such knowledge will either always or almost always be presumed to involve some fallibility. The majority of epistemologists still work towards what they hope will be a non-skeptical conception of knowledge; and attaining this outcome could well need to include their solving the Gettier challenge without adopting the Infallibility Proposal.

8. Attempted Solutions: Eliminating Luck

The other feature of Gettier cases that was highlighted in section 5 is the lucky way in which such a case’s protagonist has a belief which is both justified and true. Is it this luck that needs to be eliminated if the situation is to become one in which the belief in question is knowledge? In general, must any instance of knowledge include no accidentalness in how its combination of truth, belief, and justification is effected? The Eliminate Luck Proposal claims so.

Almost all epistemologists, when analyzing Gettier cases, reach for some version of this idea, at least in their initial or intuitive explanations of why knowledge is absent from the cases. Unger (1968) is one who has also sought to make this a fuller and more considered part of an explanation for the lack of knowledge. He says that a belief is not knowledge if it is true only courtesy of some relevant accident. That description is meant to allow for some flexibility. Even so, further care will still be needed if the Eliminate Luck Proposal is to provide real insight and understanding. After all, if we seek to eliminate all luck whatsoever from the production of the justified true belief (if knowledge is thereby to be present), then we are again endorsing a version of infallibilism (as described in section 7). If no luck is involved in the justificatory situation, the justification renders the belief’s truth wholly predictable or inescapable; in which case, the belief is being infallibly justified. And this would be a requirement which (as section 7 explained) few epistemologists will find illuminating, certainly not as a response to Gettier cases.

What many epistemologists therefore say, instead, is that the problem within Gettier cases is the presence of too much luck. Some luck is to be allowed; otherwise, we would again have reached for the Infallibility Proposal. But too large a degree of luck is not to be allowed. This is why we often find epistemologists describing Gettier cases as containing too much chance or flukiness for knowledge to be present.

Nevertheless, how helpful is that kind of description by those epistemologists? How much luck is too much? That is a conceptually vital question. Yet there has been no general agreement among epistemologists as to what degree of luck precludes knowledge. There has not even been much attempt to determine that degree. (It is no coincidence, similarly, that epistemologists in general are also yet to determine how strong — if it is allowed to be something short of infallibility — the justificatory support needs to be within any case of knowledge.) A specter of irremediable vagueness thus haunts the Eliminate Luck Proposal.

Perhaps understandably, therefore, the more detailed epistemological analyses of knowledge have focused less on delineating dangerous degrees of luck than on characterizing substantive kinds of luck that are held to drive away knowledge. Are there ways in which Gettier situations are structured, say, which amount to the presence of a kind of luck which precludes the presence of knowledge (even when there is a justified true belief)? Most attempts to solve Gettier’s challenge instantiate this form of thinking. In sections 9 through 11, we will encounter a few of the main suggestions that have been made.

9. Attempted Solutions: Eliminating False Evidence

A lot of epistemologists have been attracted to the idea that the failing within Gettier cases is the person’s including something false in her evidence. This would be a problem for her, because she is relying upon that evidence in her attempt to gain knowledge, and because knowledge is itself always true. To the extent that falsity is guiding the person’s thinking in forming the belief that p, she will be lucky to derive a belief that p which is true. And (as section 8 indicated) there are epistemologists who think that a lucky derivation of a true belief is not a way to know that truth. Let us therefore consider the No False Evidence Proposal.

In Gettier’s Case I, for example, Smith includes in his evidence the false belief that Jones will get the job. If Smith had lacked that evidence (and if nothing else were to change within the case), presumably he would not have inferred belief b. He would probably have had no belief at all as to who would get the job (because he would have had no evidence at all on the matter). If so, he would thereby not have had a justified and true belief b which failed to be knowledge. Should JTB therefore be modified so as to say that no belief is knowledge if the person’s justificatory support for it includes something false? JTB would then tell us that one’s knowing that p is one’s having a justified true belief which is well supported by evidence, none of which is false.

That is the No False Evidence Proposal. But epistemologists have noticed a few possible problems with it.

First, as Richard Feldman (1974) saw, there seem to be some Gettier cases in which no false evidence is used. Imagine that (contrary to Gettier’s own version of Case I) Smith does not believe, falsely, “Jones will get the job.” Imagine instead that he believes, “The company president told me that Jones will get the job.” (He could have continued to form the first belief. But suppose that, as it happens, he does not form it.) This alternative belief would be true. It would also provide belief b with as much justification as the false belief provided. So, if all else is held constant within the case (with belief b still being formed), again Smith has a true belief which is well-although-fallibly justified, yet which might well not be knowledge.

Second, it will be difficult for the No False Evidence Proposal not to imply an unwelcome skepticism. Quite possibly, there is always some false evidence being relied upon, at least implicitly, as we form beliefs. Is there nothing false at all — not even a single falsity — in your thinking, as you move through the world, enlarging your stock of beliefs in various ways (not all of which ways are completely reliable and clearly under your control)? If there is even some falsity among the beliefs you use, but if you do not wholly remove it or if you do not isolate it from the other beliefs you are using, then — on the No False Evidence Proposal — there is a danger of its preventing those other beliefs from ever being knowledge. This is a worry to be taken seriously, if a belief’s being knowledge is to depend upon the total absence of falsity from one’s thinking in support of that belief.

Unsurprisingly, therefore, some epistemologists, such as Lehrer (1965), have proposed a further modification of JTB — a less demanding one. They have suggested that what is needed for knowing that p is an absence only of significant and ineliminable (non-isolable) falsehoods from one’s evidence for p’s being true. Here is what that means. First, false beliefs which you are — but need not have been — using as evidence for p are eliminable from your evidence for p. And, second, false beliefs whose absence would seriously weaken your evidence for p are significant within your evidence for p. Accordingly, the No False Evidence Proposal now becomes the No False Core Evidence Proposal. The latter proposal says that if the only falsehoods in your evidence for p are ones which you could discard, and ones whose absence would not seriously weaken your evidence for p, then (with all else being equal) your justification is adequate for giving you knowledge that p. The accompanying application of that proposal to Gettier cases would claim that because, within each such case, some falsehood plays an important role in the protagonist’s evidence, her justified true belief based on that evidence fails to be knowledge. On the modified proposal, this would be the reason for the lack of that knowledge.

One fundamental problem confronting that proposal is obviously its potential vagueness. To what extent, precisely, need you be able to eliminate the false evidence in question if knowledge that p is to be present? How easy, exactly, must this be for you? And just how weakened, exactly, may your evidence for p become — courtesy of the elimination of false elements within it — before it is too weak to be part of making your belief that p knowledge? Such questions still await answers from epistemologists.

10. Attempted Solutions: Eliminating Defeat

Section 9 explored the suggestion that the failing within any Gettier case is a matter of what is included within a given person’s evidence: specifically, some core falsehood is accepted within her evidence. A converse idea has also received epistemological attention — the thought that the failing within any Gettier case is a matter of what is not included in the person’s evidence: specifically, some notable truth or fact is absent from her evidence. This proposal would not simply be that the evidence overlooks at least one fact or truth. Like the unmodified No False Evidence Proposal (with which section 9 began), that would be far too demanding, undoubtedly leading to skepticism. Because there are always some facts or truths not noticed by anyone’s evidence for a particular belief, there would be no knowledge either. No one’s evidence for p would ever be good enough to satisfy the justification requirement that is generally held to be necessary to a belief that p’s being knowledge.

Epistemologists therefore restrict the proposal, turning it into what is often called a defeasibility analysis of knowledge. It can also be termed the No Defeat Proposal. The thought behind it is that JTB should be modified so as to say that what is needed in knowing that p is an absence from the inquirer’s context of any defeaters of her evidence for p. And what is a defeater? A particular fact or truth t defeats a body of justification j (as support for a belief that p) if adding t to j, thereby producing a new body of justification j*, would seriously weaken the justificatory support being provided for that belief that p — so much so that j* does not provide strong enough support to make even the true belief that p knowledge. This means that t is relevant to justifying p (because otherwise adding it to j would produce neither a weakened nor a strengthened j*) as support for p — but damagingly so. In effect, insofar as one wishes to have beliefs which are knowledge, one should only have beliefs which are supported by evidence that is not overlooking any facts or truths which — if left overlooked — function as defeaters of whatever support is being provided by that evidence for those beliefs.

In Case I, for instance, we might think that the reason why Smith’s belief b fails to be knowledge is that his evidence includes no awareness of the facts that he will get the job himself and that his own pocket contains ten coins. Thus, imagine a variation on Gettier’s case, in which Smith’s evidence does include a recognition of these facts about himself. Then either (i) he would have conflicting evidence (by having this evidence supporting his, plus the original evidence supporting Jones’s, being about to get the job), or (ii) he would not have conflicting evidence (if his original evidence about Jones had been discarded, leaving him with only the evidence about himself). But in either of those circumstances Smith would be justified in having belief b — concerning “the person,” whoever it would be, who will get the job. Moreover, in that circumstance he would not obviously be in a Gettier situation — with his belief b still failing to be knowledge. For, on either (i) or (ii), there would be no defeaters of his evidence — no facts which are being overlooked by his evidence, and which would seriously weaken his evidence if he were not overlooking them.

Unfortunately, however, this proposal — like the No False Core Evidence Proposal in section 9 — faces a fundamental problem of vagueness. As we have seen, defeaters defeat by weakening justification: as more and stronger defeaters are being overlooked by a particular body of evidence, that evidence is correlatively weakened. (This is so, even when the defeaters clash directly with one’s belief that p. And it is so, regardless of the believer’s not realizing that the evidence is thereby weakened.) How weak, exactly, can the justification for a belief that p become before it is too weak to sustain the belief’s being knowledge that p? This question — which, in one form or another, arises for all proposals which allow knowledge’s justificatory component to be satisfied by fallible justificatory support — is yet to be answered by epistemologists as a group. In the particular instance of the No Defeat Proposal, it is the question, raised by epistemologists such as William Lycan (1977) and Lehrer and Paxson (1969), of how much — and which aspects — of one’s environment need to be noticed by one’s evidence, if that evidence is to be justification that makes one’s belief that p knowledge. There can be much complexity in one’s environment, with it not always being clear where to draw the line between aspects of the environment which do — and those which do not — need to be noticed by one’s evidence. How strict should we be in what we expect of people in this respect?

11. Attempted Solutions: Eliminating Inappropriate Causality

It has also been suggested that the failing within Gettier situations is one of causality, with the justified true belief being caused — generated, brought about — in too odd or abnormal a way for it to be knowledge. This Appropriate Causality Proposal — initially advocated by Alvin Goldman (1967) — will ask us to consider, by way of contrast, any case of observational knowledge. Seemingly, a necessary part of such knowledge’s being produced is a stable and normal causal pattern’s generating the belief in question. You use your eyes in a standard way, for example. A belief might then form in a standard way, reporting what you observed. That belief will be justified in a standard way, too, partly by that use of your eyes. And it will be true in a standard way, reporting how the world actually is in a specific respect. All of this reflects the causal stability of normal visually-based belief-forming processes. In particular, we realize that the object of the knowledge — that perceived aspect of the world which most immediately makes the belief true — is playing an appropriate role in bringing the belief into existence.

Within Gettier’s Case I, however, that pattern of normality is absent. The aspects of the world which make Smith’s belief b true are the facts of his getting the job and of there being ten coins in his own pocket. But these do not help to cause the existence of belief b. (That belief is caused by Smith’s awareness of other facts — his conversation with the company president and his observation of the contents of Jones’s pocket.) Should JTB be modified accordingly, so as to tell us that a justified true belief is knowledge only if those aspects of the world which make it true are appropriately involved in causing it to exist?

Epistemologists have noticed problems with that Appropriate Causality Proposal, though.

First, some objects of knowledge might be aspects of the world which are unable ever to have causal influences. In knowing that 2 + 2 = 4 (this being a prima facie instance of what epistemologists term a priori knowledge), you know a truth — perhaps a fact — about numbers. And do they have causal effects? Most epistemologists do not believe so. (Maybe instances of numerals, such as marks on paper being interpreted on particular occasions in specific minds, can have causal effects. Yet — it is usually said — such numerals are merely representations of numbers. They are not the actual numbers.) Consequently, it is quite possible that the scope of the Appropriate Causality Proposal is more restricted than is epistemologically desirable. The proposal would apply only to empirical or a posteriori knowledge, knowledge of the observable world — which is to say that it might not apply to all of the knowledge that is actually or possibly available to people. And (as section 6 explained) epistemologists seek to understand all actual or possible knowledge, not just some of it.

Second, to what extent will the Appropriate Causality Proposal help us to understand even empirical knowledge? The problem is that epistemologists have not agreed on any formula for exactly how (if there is to be knowledge that p) the fact that p is to contribute to bringing about the existence of the justified true belief that p. Inevitably (and especially when reasoning is involved), there will be indirectness in the causal process resulting in the formation of the belief that p. But how much indirectness is too much? That is, are there degrees of indirectness that are incompatible with there being knowledge that p? And if so, how are we to specify those critical degrees?

For example, suppose that (in an altered Case I of which we might conceive) Smith’s being about to be offered the job is actually part of the causal explanation of why the company president told him that Jones would get the job. The president, with his mischievous sense of humor, wished to mislead Smith. And suppose that Smith’s having ten coins in his pocket made a jingling noise, subtly putting him in mind of coins in pockets, subsequently leading him to discover how many coins were in Jones’s pocket. Given all of this, the facts which make belief b true (namely, those ones concerning Smith’s getting the job and concerning the presence of the ten coins in his pocket) will actually have been involved in the causal process that brings belief b into existence. Would the Appropriate Causality Proposal thereby be satisfied — so that (in this altered Case I) belief b would now be knowledge? Or should we continue regarding the situation as being a Gettier case, a situation in which (as in the original Case I) the belief b fails to be knowledge? If we say that the situation remains a Gettier case, we need to explain why this new causal ancestry for belief b would still be too inappropriate to allow belief b to be knowledge.

Most epistemologists will regard the altered case as a Gettier case. But in that event they continue to owe us an analysis of what makes a given causal history inappropriate. Often, they talk of deviant causal chains. And that is an evocative phrase. But how clear is it? Once more, we will wonder about vagueness. In particular, we will ask, how deviant can a causal chain (one that results in some belief-formation) become before it is too deviant to be able to be bringing knowledge into existence? As we also found in sections 9 and 10, a conceptually deep problem of vagueness thus remains to be solved.

12. Attempted Dissolutions: Competing Intuitions

Sections 9 through 11 described some of the main proposals that epistemologists have made for solving the Gettier challenge directly. Those proposals accept the usual interpretation of each Gettier case as containing a justified true belief which fails to be knowledge. Each proposal then attempts to modify JTB, the traditional epistemological suggestion for what it is to know that p. What is sought by those proposals, therefore, is an analysis of knowledge which accords with the usual interpretation of Gettier cases. That analysis would be intended to cohere with the claim that knowledge is not present within Gettier cases. And why is it so important to cohere with the latter claim? The standard answer offered by epistemologists points to what they believe is their strong intuition that, within any Gettier case, knowledge is absent. Almost all epistemologists claim to have this intuition about Gettier cases. They treat this intuition with much respect. (It seems that most do so as part of a more general methodology, one which involves the respectful use of intuitions within many areas of philosophy. Frank Jackson [1998] is a prominent proponent of that methodology’s ability to aid our philosophical understanding of key concepts.)

Nonetheless, a few epistemological voices dissent from that approach (as this section and the next will indicate). These seek to dissolve the Gettier challenge. Instead of accepting the standard interpretation of Gettier cases, and instead of trying to find a direct solution to the challenge that the cases are thereby taken to ground, a dissolution of the cases denies that they ground any such challenge in the first place. And one way of developing such a dissolution is to deny or weaken the usual intuition by which almost all epistemologists claim to be guided in interpreting Gettier cases.

One such attempt has involved a few epistemologists — Jonathan Weinberg, Shaun Nichols, and Stephen Stich (2001) — conducting empirical research which (they argue) casts doubt upon the evidential force of the usual epistemological intuition about the cases. When epistemologists claim to have a strong intuition that knowledge is missing from Gettier cases, they take themselves to be representative of people in general (specifically, in how they use the word “knowledge” and its cognates such as “know,” knower,” and the like). That intuition is therefore taken to reflect how “we” — people in general — conceive of knowledge. It is thereby assumed to be an accurate indicator of pertinent details of the concept of knowledge — which is to say, “our” concept of knowledge. Yet what is it that gives epistemologists such confidence in their being representative of how people in general use the word “knowledge”? Mostly, epistemologists test this view of themselves upon their students and upon other epistemologists. The empirical research by Weinberg, Nichols, and Stich asked a wider variety of people — including ones from outside of university or college settings — about Gettier cases. And that research has reported encountering a wider variety of reactions to the cases. When people who lack much, or even any, prior epistemological awareness are presented with descriptions of Gettier cases, will they unhesitatingly say (as epistemologists do) that the justified true beliefs within those cases fail to be knowledge? The empirical evidence gathered so far suggests some intriguing disparities in this regard — including ones that might reflect varying ethnic ancestries or backgrounds. In particular, respondents of east Asian or Indian sub-continental descent were found to be more open than were European Americans (of “Western” descent) to classifying Gettier cases as situations in which knowledge is present. A similar disparity seemed to be correlated with respondents’ socio-economic status.

Those data are preliminary. (And other epistemologists have not sought to replicate those surveys.) Nonetheless, the data are suggestive. At the very least, they constitute some empirical evidence that does not simply accord with epistemologists’ usual interpretation of Gettier cases. Hence, a real possibility has been raised that epistemologists, in how they interpret Gettier cases, are not so accurately representative of people in general. Their shared, supposedly intuitive, interpretation of the cases might be due to something distinctive in how they, as a group, think about knowledge, rather than being merely how people as a whole regard knowledge. In other words, perhaps the apparent intuition about knowledge (as it pertains to Gettier situations) that epistemologists share with each other is not universally shared. Maybe it is at least not shared with as many other people as epistemologists assume is the case. And if so, then the epistemologists’ intuition might not merit the significance they have accorded it when seeking a solution to the Gettier challenge. (Indeed, that challenge itself might not be as distinctively significant as epistemologists have assumed it to be. This possibility arises once we recognize that the prevalence of that usual putative intuition among epistemologists has been important to their deeming, in the first place, that Gettier cases constitute a decisive challenge to our understanding of what it is to know that p.)

Epistemologists might reply that people who think that knowledge is present within Gettier cases are not evaluating the cases properly — that is, as the cases should be interpreted. The question thus emerges of whether epistemologists’ intuitions are particularly trustworthy on this topic. Are they more likely to be accurate (than are other people’s intuitions) in what they say about knowledge — in assessing its presence in, or its absence from, specific situations? Presumably, most epistemologists will think so, claiming that when other people do not concur that in Gettier cases there is a lack of knowledge, those competing reactions reflect a lack of understanding of the cases — a lack of understanding which could well be rectified by sustained epistemological reflection.

Potentially, that disagreement has methodological implications about the nature and point of epistemological inquiry. For we should wonder whether those epistemologists, insofar as their confidence in their interpretation of Gettier cases rests upon their more sustained reflection about such matters, are really giving voice to intuitions as such about Gettier cases when claiming to be doing so. Or are they instead applying some comparatively reflective theories of knowledge? The latter alternative need not make their analyses mistaken, of course. But it would make more likely the possibility that the analyses of knowledge which epistemologists develop in order to understand Gettier cases are not based upon a directly intuitive reading of the cases. This might weaken the strength and independence of the epistemologists’ evidential support for those analyses of knowledge.

For example, maybe the usual epistemological interpretation of Gettier cases is manifesting a commitment to a comparatively technical and demanding concept of knowledge, one that only reflective philosophers would use and understand. Even if the application of that concept feels intuitive to them, this could be due to the kind of technical training that they have experienced. It might not be a coincidence, either, that epistemologists tend to present Gettier cases by asking the audience, “So, is this justified true belief within the case really knowledge?” — thereby suggesting, through this use of emphasis, that there is an increased importance in making the correct assessment of the situation. The audience might well feel a correlative caution about saying that knowledge is present. They could feel obliged to take care not to accord knowledge if there is anything odd — as, clearly, there is — about the situation being discussed. When that kind of caution and care are felt to be required, then — as contextualist philosophers such as David Lewis (1996) have argued is appropriate — we are more likely to deny that knowledge is present.

Hence, if epistemologists continue to insist that the nature of knowledge is such as to satisfy one of their analyses (where this includes knowledge’s being such that it is absent from Gettier cases), then there is a correlative possibility that they are talking about something — knowledge — that is too difficult for many, if any, inquirers ever to attain. How should people — as potential or actual inquirers — react to that possibility? Mark Kaplan (1985) has argued that insofar as knowledge must conform to the demands of Gettier cases (and to the usual epistemological interpretation of them), knowledge is not something about which we should care greatly as inquirers. And the fault would be knowledge’s, not ours. Kaplan advocates our seeking something less demanding and more realistically attainable than knowledge is if it needs to cohere with the usual interpretation of Gettier cases. (An alternative thought which Kaplan’s argument might prompt us to investigate is that of whether knowledge itself could be something less demanding — even while still being at least somewhat worth seeking. Section 13 will discuss that idea.)

Those pivotal issues are currently unresolved. In the meantime, their presence confirms that, by thinking about Gettier cases, we may naturally raise some substantial questions about epistemological methodology — about the methods via which we should be trying to understand knowledge. Those questions include the following ones. What evidence should epistemologists consult as they strive to learn the nature of knowledge? Should they be perusing intuitions? If so, whose? Their own? How should competing intuitions be assessed? And how strongly should favored intuitions be relied upon anyway? Are they to be decisive? Are they at least powerful? Or are they no more than a starting-point for further debate — a provider, not an adjudicator, of relevant ideas?

13. Attempted Dissolutions: Knowing Luckily

Section 12 posed the question of whether supposedly intuitive assessments of Gettier situations support the usual interpretation of the cases as strongly — or even as intuitively — as epistemologists generally believe is the case. How best might that question be answered? Sections 5 and 8 explained that when epistemologists seek to support that usual interpretation in a way that is meant to remain intuitive, they typically begin by pointing to the luck that is present within the cases. That luck is standardly thought to be a powerful — yet still intuitive — reason why the justified true beliefs inside Gettier cases fail to be knowledge.

Nevertheless, a contrary interpretation of the luck’s role has also been proposed, by Stephen Hetherington (1998; 2001). It means to reinstate the sufficiency of JTB, thereby dissolving Gettier’s challenge. That contrary interpretation could be called the Knowing Luckily Proposal. And it analyses Gettier’s Case I along the following lines.

This alternative interpretation concedes (in accord with the usual interpretation) that, in forming his belief b, Smith is lucky to be gaining a belief which is true. More fully: He is lucky to do so, given the evidence by which he is being guided in forming that belief, and given the surrounding facts of his situation. In that sense (we might say), Smith came close to definitely lacking knowledge. (For in that sense he came close to forming a false belief; and a belief which is false is definitely not knowledge.) But to come close to definitely lacking knowledge need not be to lack knowledge. It might merely be to almost lack knowledge. So (as we might also say), it could be to know, albeit luckily so. Smith would have knowledge, in virtue of having a justified true belief. (We would thus continue to regard JTB as being true.) However, because Smith would only luckily have that justified true belief, he would only luckily have that knowledge.

Most epistemologists will object that this sounds like too puzzling a way to talk about knowing. Their reaction is natural. Even this Knowing Luckily Proposal would probably concede that there is very little (if any) knowledge which is lucky in so marked or dramatic a way. And because there is so little (if any) such knowledge, our everyday lives leave us quite unused to thinking of some knowledge as being present within ourselves or others quite so luckily: we would actually encounter little (if any) such knowledge. To the extent that the kind of luck involved in such cases reflects the statistical unlikelihood of such circumstances occurring, therefore, we should expect at least most knowledge not to be present in that lucky way. (Otherwise, this would be the normal way for knowledge to be present. It would not in fact be an unusual way. Hence, strictly speaking, the knowledge would not be present only luckily.)

But even if the Knowing Luckily Proposal agrees that, inevitably, at least most knowledge will be present in comparatively normal ways, the proposal will deny that this entails the impossibility of there ever being at least some knowledge which is present more luckily. Ordinarily, when good evidence for a belief that p accompanies the belief’s being true (as it does in Case I), this combination of good evidence and true belief occurs (unlike in Case I) without any notable luck being needed. Ordinary knowledge is thereby constituted, with that absence of notable luck being part of what makes instances of ordinary knowledge ordinary in our eyes. What is ordinary to us will not strike us as being present only luckily. Again, though, is it therefore impossible for knowledge ever to be constituted luckily? The Knowing Luckily Proposal claims that such knowledge is possible even if uncommon. The proposal will grant that there would be a difference between knowing that p in a comparatively ordinary way and knowing that p in a comparatively lucky way. Knowing comparatively luckily that p would be (i) knowing that p (where this might remain one’s having a justified true belief that p), even while also (ii) running, or having run, a greater risk of not having that knowledge that p. In that sense, it would be to know that p less securely or stably or dependably, more fleetingly or unpredictably.

There are many forms that the lack of stability — the luck involved in the knowledge’s being present — could take. Sometimes it might include the knowledge’s having one of the failings found within Gettier cases. The knowledge — the justified true belief — would be present in a correspondingly lucky way. One interpretive possibility — from Hetherington (2001) — is that of describing this knowledge that p as being of a comparatively poor quality as knowledge that p. Normally, knowledge that p is of a higher quality than this — being less obviously flawed, by being less luckily present. The question persists, though: Must all knowledge that p be, in effect, normal knowledge that p — being of a normal quality as knowledge that p? Or could we sometimes — even if rarely — know that p in a comparatively poor and undesirable way? The Knowing Luckily Proposal allows that this is possible — that this is a conceivable form for some knowledge to take.

That proposal is yet to be widely accepted among epistemologists. Their main objection to it has been what they have felt to be the oddity of talking of knowledge in that way. Accordingly, the epistemological resistance to the proposal partly reflects the standard adherence to the dominant ("intuitive") interpretation of Gettier cases. Yet this section and the previous one have asked whether epistemologists should be wedded to that interpretation of Gettier cases. So, this section leaves us with the following question: Is it conceptually coherent to regard the justified true beliefs within Gettier cases as instances of knowledge which are luckily produced or present? And how are we to answer that question anyway? With intuitions? Whose? Once again, we encounter section 12’s questions about the proper methodology for making epistemological progress on this issue.

14. Gettier Cases and Analytic Epistemology

Since the initial philosophical description in 1963 of Gettier cases, the project of responding to them (so as to understand what it is to know that p) has often been central to the practice of analytic epistemology. Partly this recurrent centrality has been due to epistemologists’ taking the opportunity to think in detail about the nature of justification — about what justification is like in itself, and about how it is constitutively related to knowledge. But partly, too, that recurrent centrality reflects the way in which, epistemologists have often assumed, responding adequately to Gettier cases requires the use of a paradigm example of a method that has long been central to analytic philosophy. That method involves the considered manipulation and modification of definitional models or theories, in reaction to clear counterexamples to those models or theories.

Thus (we saw in section 2), JTB purported to provide a definitional analysis of what it is to know that p. JTB aimed to describe, at least in general terms, the separable-yet-combinable components of such knowledge. Then Gettier cases emerged, functioning as apparently successful counterexamples to one aspect — the sufficiency — of JTB’s generic analysis. That interpretation of the cases’ impact rested upon epistemologists’ claims to have reflective-yet-intuitive insight into the absence of knowledge from those actual or possible Gettier circumstances. These claims of intuitive insight were treated by epistemologists as decisive data, somewhat akin to favored observations. The claims were to be respected accordingly; and, it was assumed, any modification of the theory encapsulated in JTB would need to be evaluated for how well it accommodated them. So, the entrenchment of the Gettier challenge at the core of analytic epistemology hinged upon epistemologists’ confident assumptions that (i) JTB failed to accommodate the data provided by those intuitions — and that (ii) any analytical modification of JTB would need (and would be able) to be assessed for whether it accommodated such intuitions. That was the analytical method which epistemologists proceeded to apply, vigorously and repeatedly.

Nevertheless, the history of post-1963 analytic epistemology has also contained repeated expressions of frustration at the seemingly insoluble difficulties that have accompanied the many attempts to respond to Gettier’s disarmingly simple paper. Precisely how should the theory JTB be revised, in accord with the relevant data? Exactly which data are relevant anyway? We have seen in the foregoing sections that there is much room for dispute and uncertainty about all of this. For example, we have found a persistent problem of vagueness confronting various attempts to revise JTB. This might have us wondering whether a complete analytical definition of knowledge that p is even possible.

That is especially so, given that vagueness itself is a phenomenon, the proper understanding of which is yet to be agreed upon by philosophers. There is much contemporary discussion of what it even is (see Keefe and Smith 1996). On one suggested interpretation, vagueness is a matter of people in general not knowing where to draw a precise and clearly accurate line between instances of X and instances of non-X (for some supposedly vague phenomenon of being X, such as being bald or being tall). On that interpretation of vagueness, such a dividing line would exist; we would just be ignorant of its location. To many philosophers, that idea sounds regrettably odd when the vague phenomenon in question is baldness, say. (“You claim that there is an exact dividing line, in terms of the number of hairs on a person’s head, between being bald and not being bald? I find that claim extremely hard to believe.”) But should philosophers react with such incredulity when the phenomenon in question is that of knowing, and when the possibility of vagueness is being prompted by discussions of the Gettier problem? For most epistemologists remain convinced that their standard reaction to Gettier cases reflects, in part, the existence of a definite difference between knowing and not knowing. But where, exactly, is that dividing line to be found? As we have observed, the usual epistemological answers to this question seek to locate and to understand the dividing line in terms of degrees and kinds of justification or something similar. Accordingly, the threats of vagueness we have noticed in some earlier sections of this article might be a problem for many epistemologists. Possibly, those forms of vagueness afflict epistemologists’ knowing that a difference between knowledge and non-knowledge is revealed by Gettier cases. Epistemologists continue regarding the cases in that way. Are they right to do so? Do they have that supposed knowledge of what Gettier cases show about knowledge?

The Gettier challenge has therefore become a test case for analytically inclined philosophers. The following questions have become progressively more pressing with each failed attempt to convince epistemologists as a group that, in a given article or talk or book, the correct analysis of knowledge has finally been reached. Will an adequate understanding of knowledge ever emerge from an analytical balancing of various theories of knowledge against relevant data such as intuitions? Must any theory of the nature of knowledge be answerable to intuitions prompted by Gettier cases in particular? And must epistemologists’ intuitions about the cases be supplemented by other people’s intuitions, too? What kind of theory of knowledge is at stake? What general form should the theory take? And what degree of precision should it have? If we are seeking an understanding of knowledge, must this be a logically or conceptually exhaustive understanding? (The methodological model of theory-being-tested-against-data suggests a scientific parallel. Yet need scientific understanding always be logically or conceptually exhaustive if it is to be real understanding?)

The issues involved are complex and subtle. No analysis has received general assent from epistemologists, and the methodological questions remain puzzling. Debate therefore continues. There is uncertainty as to whether Gettier cases — and thereby knowledge — can ever be fully understood. There is also uncertainty as to whether the Gettier challenge can be dissolved. Have we fully understood the challenge itself? What exactly is Gettier’s legacy? As epistemologists continue to ponder these questions, it is not wholly clear where their efforts will lead us. Conceptual possibilities still abound.

15. References and Further Reading

  • Ayer, A. J. (1956). The Problem of Knowledge (London: Macmillan), ch. 1.
    • Presents a well-regarded pre-Gettier JTB analysis of knowledge.
  • Chisholm, R. M. (1966/1977/1989). Theory of Knowledge (any of the three editions). (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall).
    • Includes the sheep-in-the-field Gettier case, along with attempts to repair JTB.
  • Descartes, R. (1911 [1641]). The Philosophical Works of Descartes, Vol. I, (eds. and trans.) E. S. Haldane and G. R. T. Ross. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
    • Contains the Meditations, which develops and applies Descartes’s conception of knowledge as needing to be infallible.
  • Feldman, R. (1974). “An Alleged Defect in Gettier Counterexamples.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 52: 68-9. Reprinted in Moser (1986).
    • Presents a Gettier case in which, it is claimed, no false evidence is used by the believer.
  • Gettier, E. L. (1963). “Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?” Analysis 23: 121-3. Reprinted in Roth and Galis (1970) and Moser (1986).
  • Goldman, A. I. (1967). “A Causal Theory of Knowing.” Journal of Philosophy 64: 357-72. Reprinted, with revisions, in Roth and Galis (1970).
    • The initial presentation of a No Inappropriate Causality Proposal.
  • Goldman, A. I.. (1976). “Discrimination and Perceptual Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy 73: 771-91. Reprinted in Pappas and Swain (1978).
    • Includes the fake-barns Gettier case.
  • Hetherington, S. (1996). Knowledge Puzzles: An Introduction to Epistemology (Boulder, Colo.: Westview Press).
    • Includes an introduction to the justified-true-belief analysis of knowledge, and to several responses to Gettier’s challenge.
  • Hetherington, S. (1998). “Actually Knowing.” Philosophical Quarterly 48: 453-69.
    • Includes a version of the Knowing Luckily Proposal.
  • Hetherington, S. (2001). Good Knowledge, Bad Knowledge: On Two Dogmas of Epistemology (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • Extends the Knowing Luckily Proposal, by explaining the idea of having qualitatively better or worse knowledge that p.
  • Jackson, F. (1998). From Metaphysics to Ethics: A Defence of Conceptual Analysis (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • Includes discussion of Gettier cases and the role of intuitions and conceptual analysis.
  • Kaplan, M. (1985). “It’s Not What You Know That Counts.” Journal of Philosophy 82: 350-63.
    • Argues that, given Gettier cases, knowledge is not what inquirers should seek.
  • Keefe, R. and Smith, P. (eds.) (1996). Vagueness: A Reader (Cambridge, Mass.: The MIT Press).
    • Contains both historical and contemporary analyses of the nature and significance of vagueness in general.
  • Kirkham, R. L. (1984). “Does the Gettier Problem Rest on a Mistake?” Mind 93: 501-13.
    • Argues that the usual interpretation of Gettier cases depends upon applying an extremely demanding conception of knowledge to the described situations, a conception with skeptical implications.
  • Lehrer, K. (1965). “Knowledge, Truth and Evidence.” Analysis 25: 168-75. Reprinted in Roth and Galis (1970).
    • Presents a No Core False Evidence Proposal.
  • Lehrer, K. (1971). “Why Not Scepticism?” The Philosophical Forum 2: 283-98. Reprinted in Pappas and Swain (1978).
    • Outlines a skepticism based on an Infallibility Proposal about knowledge.
  • Lehrer, K., and Paxson, T. D. (1969). “Knowledge: Undefeated Justified True Belief.” Journal of Philosophy 66: 225-37. Reprinted in Pappas and Swain (1978).
    • Presents a No Defeat Proposal.
  • Lewis, D. (1996). “Elusive Knowledge.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 549-67.
    • Includes a much-discussed response to Gettier cases which pays attention to nuances in how people discuss knowledge.
  • Lycan, W. G. (1977). “Evidence One Does not Possess.” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 55: 114-26.
    • Discusses potential complications in a No Defeat Proposal.
  • Lycan, W. G. (2006). “On the Gettier Problem Problem.” In Epistemology Futures, (ed.) S. Hetherington. (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
    • A recent overview of the history of attempted solutions to the Gettier problem.
  • Moser, P. K. (ed.) (1986). Empirical Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology (Totowa, NJ: Rowman & Littlefield).
    • Contains some influential papers on Gettier cases.
  • Pappas, G. S., and Swain, M. (eds.) (1978). Essays on Knowledge and Justification (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press).
    • A key anthology, mainly on the Gettier problem.
  • Plato. Meno 97a-98b.
    • For what epistemologists generally regard as being an early version of JTB.
  • Plato. Theatetus 200d-210c.
    • For seminal philosophical discussion of some possible instances of JTB.
  • Roth, M. D., and Galis, L. (eds.) (1970). Knowing: Essays in the Analysis of Knowledge (New York: Random House).
    • Includes some noteworthy papers on Gettier’s challenge.
  • Shope, R. K. (1983). The Analysis of Knowing: A Decade of Research (Princeton: Princeton University Press).
    • Presents many Gettier cases; discusses several proposed analyses of them.
  • Skyrms, B. (1967). “The Explication of ‘X Knows that p’.” Journal of Philosophy 64: 373-89. Reprinted in Roth and Galis (1970).
    • Includes the pyromaniac Gettier case.
  • Unger, P. (1968). “An Analysis of Factual Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy 65: 157-70. Reprinted in Roth and Galis (1970).
    • Presents an Eliminate Luck Proposal.
  • Unger, P. (1971). “A Defense of Skepticism.” The Philosophical Review 30: 198-218. Reprinted in Pappas and Swain (1978).
    • Defends and applies an Infallibility Proposal about knowledge.
  • Weinberg, J., Nichols, S., and Stich, S. (2001). "Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions." Philosophical Topics 29: 429-60.
    • Includes empirical data on competing (‘intuitive’) reactions to Gettier cases.
  • Williamson, T. (2000). Knowledge and Its Limits (Oxford: Oxford University Press), Intro., ch. 1.
    • Includes arguments against responding to Gettier cases with an analysis of knowledge.

Author Information

Stephen Hetherington
University of New South Wales

Consciousness, Higher-Order Theories of

Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness

Defenders of higher-order theories of consciousness hold that consciousness is explained by the relation between two levels of mental states in which a higher-order mental state takes another mental state, such as a thought or sensation, as its object. By virtue of the higher-order state, the lower-order state is conscious. For example, I now have a visual sensation of the white and black computer screen. This sensation is conscious, according to higher-order theories, because I have a higher-order state about that sensation.Two distinctions are central to isolating the sort of consciousness the theory aims to explain. First, we can make distinctions among creature consciousness, state consciousness, and introspective consciousness. Creature consciousness is a property possessed by creatures that are awake and sentient. Since wakefulness and sentience are fairly straightforward biological features, there seems to be no special problem to be solved regarding creature consciousness. State consciousness is a property of mental states that marks the difference between unconscious and conscious states. When a state is conscious, there is something it is like to be in that state. Introspective consciousness involves attending to one’s own mental states. According to higher-order theory, the mystery of consciousness lies in the nature of conscious states, and the mystery can be explained in terms of higher-order representation. My mental state is conscious – that is, there is something it is like to be in my mental state – when I have a higher-order representation about it.

An intuitive way to talk about consciousness is to say that a mental state is conscious when we are conscious of it. But this intuitive formulation utilizes two different uses of the word "conscious." The first use is called intransitive, because this form of consciousness has no object. State consciousness is an intransitive form of consciousness. The second use is called transitive, because this form of consciousness takes an object; transitive consciousness is consciousness of something. Introspective consciousness is a transitive form of consciousness, because it takes mental states as objects. With this distinction in hand we can restate the higher-order explanation in this way: intransitive state consciousness is explained in terms of transitive consciousness of mental states.

Table of Contents

  1. Two Problem of Consciousness
  2. The Higher-order Solution
  3. Higher-order Thought Theory
    1. Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV)
    2. Dispositional Higher-order Thought Theory
  4. Higher-order Perception Theory
  5. On Terminology and Target
  6. Simple or Simplistic: An Assessment
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Two Problem of Consciousness

Conscious states are a central feature of our waking life. When we gaze at a spectacular array of fall leaves as they change color, smell onions frying or touch the soft skin of a newborn, we appreciate the feelings unique to each experience. There is something it is like to have these feelings, but what exactly? Though conscious states are ubiquitous in our everyday lives, we rarely reflect on their nature, and when we do, we find them frustratingly difficult to describe. We point to the contents of consciousness, what we are conscious of, and the qualities associated with those contents: the reds and yellows of leaves, the pungent odor of onions, the smoothness of skin. The distinctive character of each of these qualities marks one problem of consciousness: how to account for the differences between red and yellow, pungent and sweet, smooth and rough. A second problem, central to higher-order theory, is to explain what is in common to all conscious states, what it is like to have any kind of feelings at all. In other words, higher-order theories of consciousness propose to explain the nature of conscious states, as such.

2. The Higher-order Solution

In order to account for the nature of conscious states, the question a higher-order theorist must answer is: why is there something it is like to be in conscious states when there is nothing it is like to be in unconscious states, such as a coma state or a state of dreamless sleep? What is the difference between these two types of states? In particular, what makes a mental state a conscious mental state? As noted above, a higher-order account of consciousness proposes that a mental state is conscious when there is a higher-order state, either a thought or a perception, about it. Say I wake up feeling a terrible pain in my knee, but as I become involved in the day’s activities, I so completely forget about the pain that it ceases to hurt. With each lull in my busy schedule, though, the feeling of pain returns in full force. In light of the similarity in feeling and biological foundation, it is reasonable to say that the same sensation of pain remains throughout the day, although I am only occasionally conscious of the pain. The higher-order theory captures the intuitive plausibility of this explanation by describing consciousness of the pain in terms of a higher-order thought or perception about the otherwise unconscious pain state. When I forget about the pain, there is no higher-order state and so I remain unconscious of the pain. Later in the day, a higher-order state about the pain recurs, and in virtue of this higher-order state I am again conscious of the pain.

The higher-order state is about the lower-order state, which is to say that an intentional relation holds between the higher-order and lower-order states. Thoughts and perceptions are two familiar sorts of intentional states. Thoughts can be about things in the world, such as a tree or an onion. Thoughts can be about abstract items, such as numbers or average families. And thoughts can be about other thoughts, as when I think: I am thinking about consciousness too much; I should take a break.

Perceptions can also be about things in the world, such as when I see a tree or smell an onion. Notably, perceptions are much more detailed than thoughts, capturing a wide array of sensory variation. On the other hand, it is less clear how perceptions could be about abstract items or thoughts. One way to perceive abstract things could be by virtue of concrete representations, so you might be said to see the number 3 by means of the numeral that represents it. Similarly, a thought might be expressed in subvocal speech, as when I think to myself a sentence like: “I am thinking about consciousness too much; I should take a break.”

The differences between thoughts and perceptions yield reasons in favor of each form of higher-order account. They will be considered in turn, beginning with the higher-order thought theory. Several versions of higher-order thought theory have been proposed since David Rosenthal (1986) introduced the theory. Two versions to be considered below are the Wide-Intrinsicality View (WIV), developed by Rocco Gennaro (1996) and the dispositional higher-order thought theory, proposed by Peter Carruthers (2000).

3. Higher-order Thought Theory

Recall that the basic role of higher-order theories is to account for the nature of conscious states in terms of higher-order states about them. According to Rosenthal’s higher-order thought theory (1986, 1997, 2005), a mental state is conscious when there is a higher-order thought about it. I am conscious of the pain in my knee when I have a thought to the effect that I am in that very pain state.

A few refinements and elaborations of this basic formulation are necessary to avert various straightforward difficulties. First, Rosenthal notes that state consciousness must seem immediate. When I am conscious of my pain, I am not conscious of any inferential process preceding the consciousness. I do not think to myself, "Wow, I just hit my knee really hard, I must be feeling pain." Similarly, if a doctor informed me that my knee surgery would likely involve lingering pain, this information alone would be insufficient to make my pain conscious. No conscious inferential or observational process intervenes between a mental state and the higher-order thought about it.

Second, consciousness is a relational property of mental states; it is not intrinsic to their nature. For example, if someone began calling you by a nickname, no intrinsic feature of you would change, but you would now be represented in a new way. Similarly, a mental state is conscious by virtue of standing in a representational relation to a higher-order thought. The mental state itself does not change when it is conscious; rather, it acquires a new relation. Some have found this feature of the higher-order account implausible, arguing that consciousness seems to mark a change in the intrinsic nature of conscious states. (Gennaro 1996) A commitment to consciousness as intrinsic prompted the introduction of a version of higher-order thought theory called the Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV) , which is discussed in the next section.

A third important feature of higher-order thoughts on Rosenthal’s account is that they are assertoric and occurrent. The higher-order thought must assert, rather than hope, fear or speculate that I am in a particular mental state. Moreover, the higher-order thought must occur at roughly the same time as the mental state it represents. The content of the higher-order thought should be, for example: "I am now feeling pain," not "I might have felt pain yesterday" or "Perhaps I will feel pain in a few minutes." Rosenthal (1997) has argued that higher-order thoughts must be occurrent in order to distinguish between non-conscious and conscious states. If the mere disposition to produce a higher-order thought were sufficient for a mental state to be conscious, it seems that all one’s mental states would always be conscious. But the example of intermittent knee pain suggests that we may be conscious of mental states at one time, and not conscious of them at another time. The recent development of a dispositional version of higher-order thought theory addresses this concern and will be considered below.

Fourth, higher-order thoughts are not introspective states. Since conscious states are a regular feature of our waking life, it may seem that higher-order thoughts should be equally apparent on this account. However, as Rosenthal (1986) points out, a higher-order thought is only conscious when there is a yet higher-order thought about it, and these conscious higher-order thoughts constitute introspective states. Since introspection is a fairly rare occurrence, it should not be surprising that we are rarely aware of our higher-order thoughts. It is interesting to note that higher-order thought theory differs from higher-order perception theory in this description of the relation between state consciousness and introspection. According to higher-order perception theory, all higher-order states are introspective states, although the active, deliberate form of introspection is fairly rare. (Armstrong 1968, 1999; Lycan 1996) Both theories agree that lower-order states are conscious by virtue of appropriate higher-order states, but they differ in their description of how the presence of higher-order states solves the problem of consciousness. While this difference could simply be a terminological issue, substantive consequences may follow (see On Terminology and Target ).

A final feature of the theory is the importance of self-reference within the content of the higher-order thought. Conscious states are mental states of one’s own. I can only be conscious of my knee pain, not yours. Rosenthal (1997) stresses that a minimal self-concept is sufficient to secure the reference necessary for higher-order thoughts; only the ability to distinguish between one’s self and something other than one’s self is required. Consequently, creatures with limited conceptual capacities may have conscious states. Where we would describe the content of a higher-order thoughts as, for example, ‘I am feeling pain,’ a more neutral formulation might be ‘this individual is feeling pain.’ Though Rosenthal minimizes the requirements for self-reference in higher-order thought content, the self, which is the subject of consciousness, figures centrally in the theory. Only a person or creature can be transitively conscious of things; mental states alone cannot bear the appropriate relation to other mental states. It may be in virtue of a mental state, namely, a higher-order thought, that one is conscious, but the higher-order thought itself cannot be transitively conscious of anything. (Rosenthal 1997) When I am conscious of my knee pain, I am conscious of the pain by virtue of a higher-order thought about the pain.

This qualification generates some confusion as to how exactly higher-order thoughts explain conscious states. (Droege 2003) First we find that consciousness is not an intrinsic feature of a mental state, it is a relational feature constituted by the presence of a higher-order thought about it. The higher-order thought explains the state consciousness. But not quite, for a higher-order thought – even of the right kind – is insufficient for state consciousness. There must be a creature who is transitively conscious of her mental states, in virtue of having a higher-order thought about them. The important role of the creature as the subject of consciousness suggests that creature consciousness bears more weight in the higher-order thought account than the definitions above admit.

Two other objections apply generally to higher-order thought accounts of consciousness. First, note that the content of the higher-order thought determines the content of consciousness. When functioning properly, the content of an occurrent mental state forms the content of the higher-order thought. It is possible, however, for higher-order thought content to be empty or to misrepresent a mental state. In such cases I might be conscious of a pain in my knee, while in fact the sensation is located in my hip, or is a phantom pain. (Neander 1998, Levine 2001) In response, Rosenthal has argued that these forms of reference failure are rare and detectable, and so do not constitute a problem for higher-order theory. (Rosenthal, 1986, 1991)

A second objection involves the possibility of animal and infant consciousness. Because thoughts require concepts, there is some question about whether simple creatures like bats are conceptually sophisticated enough to be considered conscious on this account. Carruthers (1989, 1999) has accepted the consequence that animals are not conscious on the higher-order account and has argued that our sympathy for animal suffering is motivated by the animal’s pain sensation and its behavioral effects rather than by the animal’s consciousness of pain. On the other hand, Rosenthal (1997) and Gennaro (1993, 2004b) claim that animal consciousness is not ruled out by the theory because higher-order thoughts need not be more sophisticated than conceptually rudimentary content such as “this feeling.”

a. Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV)

As noted above, versions of higher-order thought theory differ on some key points. According to the version developed by Rocco Gennaro (1996), conscious states are complex states composed of a mental state and a higher-order thought about it. This theory is known as the Wide Intrinsicality View (WIV) because consciousness is intrinsic to these complex states. The primary motivation for this version of higher-order thought theory is the sense that consciousness inheres in conscious states themselves. The remarkable change that occurs when a mental state becomes conscious seems to involve a change in that very mental state rather than a change in relations external to it. From this perspective, the relation ‘represented by a higher-order thought’ seems no more able to account for the phenomenon of consciousness than the relation ‘to the left of.' In response to this problem, the WIV takes the higher-order relation to be internal rather than external to the conscious state. Therefore, consciousness is intrinsic to the state constituted by a mental state and the higher-order thought about it.

Furthermore, a higher-order relation changes the nature of a mental state. Following Kant, Gennaro argues that concepts must be applied to sensory states in order to organize sensory information into a coherent array of objects. Higher-order thoughts provide the conceptual resources that determine the content of the conscious sensation. A self-referential component is also necessary to relate one’s experience of the world to one’s self. Yet it is important to note that the higher-order component of the conscious state is implicit. All I feel is the hurtfulness, but in order for the pain to feel the specific content of ‘hurtful,’ a higher-order concept needs to be applied to the sensation, and in order for the pain to feel hurtful to me, a self-referential component is needed as well. The higher-order thought fulfills these functions, thereby making the pain sensation conscious.

Rosenthal has objected that intrinsic theories, such as the WIV, fail to provide a reductive explanation of consciousness. If consciousness is an intrinsic property of conscious states, then they are simple and unanalyzable and so inexplicable. (Rosenthal 1986, 1991) In response, Gennaro (1996) denies that the intrinsic nature of consciousness is incompatible with its complexity. A conscious state can be explained in terms of the mental state and the higher-order thought that compose it, even though the property of consciousness is intrinsic to the whole complex state. However, as Rosenthal (1997) observes, the complexity of the conscious state makes it equally plausible to regard the property as extrinsic to the lower-order state and explainable by the presence of a distinct higher-order thought.

b. Dispositional Higher-order Thought Theory

A third version of the theory suggests that higher-order thoughts function dispositionally: mental states are conscious when they are available to a system capable of producing higher-order thoughts, even if no actual higher-order thought occurs. In answer to Rosenthal’s worry that all mental states would be conscious on a dispositional theory, Peter Carruthers (2000) has argued that two perceptual systems exist. One system is primarily action guiding and utilizes unconscious perceptual states. An unconscious pain in my knee, for example, might lead me to favor one leg when walking, even if I did not realize that I was limping. The other perceptual system is designed to generate beliefs about perceptual information, so perceptual states in this system must carry information about the pain and about my experience of the pain.

On the functional/inferential role account of content advocated by Carruthers, the content of a mental state is partly determined by the information it carries. Since the function of the belief-forming perceptual system is to produce higher-order thoughts, the states in this system take on two kinds of content: the perceptual content ‘is painful’ and the higher-order content ‘seems painful.’ The pain acquires the subjective, experiential aspect of ‘seeming painful’ by virtue of my ability to think about the pain and to form beliefs about it. The pain may cause me to limp, and it also may cause me to think about how much my knee hurts and to plan what I might do to relieve the pain. In order to be able to think about my pain, it must seem some way to me; it must seem painful. Carruthers argues that perceptual states are conscious when they acquire the higher-order content that constitutes the experiential aspect of the perceptual state.

This version of higher-order thought theory is particularly interesting because it is also a form of higher-order perception theory. According to Carruthers, both forms of content involved in conscious states are fine-grained, non-conceptual content, in other words, perceptual content. I can perceive a red object without knowing that it is red and without being able to identify its particular shade of red. Likewise, an object may seem red to me without further categorization or description, provided I have the ability to make these sorts of judgments. On the dispositional higher-order thought account, perceptual states acquire higher-order content by virtue of their availability to a system capable of forming higher-order thoughts, and they possess this dual content whether or not a higher-order thought is formed. Consequently, no actual higher-order thought or higher-order perception (and so no inner sense mechanism) is required for consciousness.

4. Higher-order Perception Theory

Though there have been more advocates of the higher-order thought theory in recent years, the higher-order perception theory is arguably the first higher-order account of consciousness. Its roots trace to John Locke’s inner sense theory where he distinguishes two ways of acquiring knowledge: perception and reflection. Perception yields ideas of sensible qualities such as yellow, hot, and soft.

“The other Fountain [reflection], from which Experience furnisheth the Understanding with Ideas, is the Perception of the Operations of our own Minds within us, as it is employ’d about the Ideas it has got.” (Essay II, 1, §4, 104) Locke describes the way we perceive the operations of our minds as comparable to an ‘internal sense.’ A few sections later in the Essay, Locke then identifies consciousness with the process of reflection when he states: “Consciousness is the perception of what passes in a Man’s own mind.” (Essay II, 1, §19, 115)

Contemporary theorists David Armstrong (1968, 1981, 1999) and William Lycan (1987, 1996) follow Locke in arguing that consciousness should be explained in terms of the operation of an inner sense. Our mental states are conscious when internal scanners produce perceptual representations of them. The process of internal scanning, or higher-order monitoring, is to coordinate and relay information about mental states in order to better plan and monitor action. Inner scanners fulfill this function by producing higher-order perceptual representations.

Like higher-order thought theory, state consciousness is explained in terms of higher-order representations of mental states. On both forms of theory my knee pain is conscious when I acquire a higher-order representation about the pain. Unlike higher-order thought theory, the higher-order representation is similar to perceptual representation on the inner sense account. Conceptual discrimination is more limited than perceptual discrimination, so one point in favor of the higher-order perception account is its ability to accommodate the rich detail of conscious states. (Lycan 2004) Moreover, no special conceptual powers are required to produce higher-order perceptions, so there is no reason animals could not be conscious on this view.

One concern about the higher-order perception theory involves the nature of the ‘inner sense.’ Although an ‘inner sense’ or ‘internal scanners’ are central to the higher-order perception theory, the theory does not depend on the existence of a dedicated organ. Armstrong (1968) has compared inner sensing to proprioception in its wide distribution and function. Lycan (1996, 2004) has suggested that inner sensing is accomplished by means of attention mechanisms.

A more persistent problem with the higher-order perception theory is the claim that it is impossible to attend to one’s mental states. Most famously argued by G.E. Moore (1903), the transparency claim is that any attempt to attend to a sensation immediately results in attention to the object that the sensation represents. A related objection notes that unlike perceptual states, no special qualities are associated with conscious states. If there was an inner sense, we would expect inner sensory qualities on a par with visual, auditory and tactile qualities. (Rosenthal 1997) Finally, it is worth noting that, like higher-order thoughts, higher-order perceptions might be empty or misrepresent the states they are about. In such a case, you might feel a sensation of pain that in fact was a sensation of cold, or you might feel a pain in the absence of any sensation at all. (Neander 1998) As with Rosenthal, Lycan (1998) takes this to be a case of a higher-order representation as of pain in the absence of a pain sensation, and argues that the result would be a strange, pain-like feeling in the absence of the behavioral effects of pain.

5. On Terminology and Target

One difficulty in comparing higher-order thought and higher-order perception theories involves determining the target for explanation. While both forms of theory are similarly structured, it is unclear that they take the same phenomenon for their explanandum. Notwithstanding disputes among the higher-order thought theorists listed above, the central claim of higher-order thought theory is clear – higher-order thoughts account for the difference between conscious states and unconscious states; state consciousness constitutes the great mystery of consciousness. The higher-order perception theory also explains the difference between conscious states and unconscious states, but Lycan (1996) argues that this difference is not the truly mysterious aspect of consciousness. Rather, the primary value in higher-order perception theory lies in its explanation of what it’s like for the subject to be in conscious states as opposed to unconscious states. Lycan identifies this explanadum as subjective consciousness. The difference may simply be a matter of emphasis, but it raises a general question about the explanandum of higher-order theory: whether the theory explains a difference in the nature of the mental states, as higher-order thought theory claims, or a difference in the nature of the subject of the mental states, as higher-order perception theory suggests.

6. Simple or Simplistic: An Assessment

The central virtue of higher-order theories of consciousness lies in their explanatory simplicity. Each of these theories accounts for the phenomena of consciousness exclusively in terms of familiar types of mental states: thoughts and perceptions. Higher-order mental states are also well-known from deliberate, self-conscious introspection. So, it seems reasonable to think that consciousness might be explained by a kind of higher-order process that is more automatic and lacks the attentive self-consciousness that accompanies more focused forms of reflection. Thus, higher-order theories avoid invoking mysterious processes or unknown structures to account for consciousness; there are no ‘ontological danglers.’ More complex states are explained in terms of less complex states and various relations, such as ‘aboutness.' As a result, consciousness is seen to be of a piece with other mental phenomena, which are in turn accountable in natural, physical terms. Consciousness is special, and in its own way mysterious, but it is amenable to explanation.

As often happens, the primary disadvantage of higher-order theories follows from their primary advantage. The explanation seems too simple to account for the elusive difference between conscious and unconscious states, and so higher-order theory strikes many as implausible. The most often cited problem – known variously as the problem of absent qualia, the hard problem of consciousness (Chalmers 1996), and the explanatory gap (Levine 1983, 2001) – is that it seems higher-order states can perform their functions in the absence of any conscious feeling. Unless one is already an adherent of the higher-order view, there seems no reason to believe that the acquisition of higher-order states, however carefully described, should usher in the sights, sounds and feels of our conscious life. Rosenthal (1991) and Lycan (1998) argue that qualitative differences, such as the difference between red and green, can be accounted for by differences in first-order sensory states. When we acquire higher-order states we become aware of these differences among our sensory states. Nonetheless, one can ask how exactly those differences become conscious by the acquisition of a higher-order state. One answer is that higher-order representation is simply what consciousness is. The intuition Rosenthal often utilizes as a grounding premise in arguing for higher-order theory is that a conscious state is a mental state one is conscious of. (Rosenthal 1986, 1993b, 1997, 2002, 2004) Given this initial premise, higher-order theory follows quickly. (Lycan 2001)

Further support for higher-order thought explanation of consciousness can be found in the connection between the acquisition of concepts and finer sensory discrimination. Wine tasters, for example, are able to appreciate subtle differences in the smell and taste of wine as a result of their understanding of its various properties. Additionally, the feeling of pain experienced by dental patients can be eased when they realize their anxiety leads them to misinterpret the vibration of the drill. (Rosenthal 2002) In defense of the higher-order perception theory, Lycan (1996) claims that an explanatory gap is unsurprising. On his account, the way each of us represents our own mental states is unique, determined by the functional role that higher-order representations play within the overall representational system that constitutes our minds. We can only talk about, and so explain, features of our first-order sensory representations – such as the difference between a sensation of red and a sensation of green – because we share the referents, red and green colored objects, in common. When we move to higher-order representation, we leave the realm of language and are left with only private means of referring to our sensations as, well, like that.

By incorporating first-order and higher-order content into the same conscious state, Carruthers (2000) and Gennaro (1996) draw a closer connection between the higher-order account of state consciousness and the account of qualitative difference. As we saw above, Carruthers maintains that conscious states have both first-order content, such as red, and higher-order content, seems red. So for Carruthers, differences in higher-order content constitute the differences in our conscious experiences of red and green. Similarly, Gennaro (2004b) argues that the qualitative properties of mental states inhere in the complex conscious state rather than in first-order states. Without the presence of a higher-order thought, the first-order perception lacks the distinctive character involved in seeing red.

In any case, it is important to recognize that higher-order theory is put forward as an empirical hypothesis, rather than an analysis of the logical relations for the term ‘consciousness.' The project is to explain the phenomena of consciousness in relation to other mental states, such as thought and perception, and so to develop a stronger theoretical framework for understanding the mind. We may be able to imagine consciousness in the absence of higher-order states, but this does not mean that we can explain consciousness in the absence of higher-order states. Or so higher-order theorists maintain. (Rosenthal 2002, Carruthers 2000)

7. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, David M. 1968. A Materialist Theory of the Mind. New York: Humanities.
  • Armstrong, David M. 1981. The Nature of Mind and Other Essays. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Armstrong, David M. 1999. The Mind-Body Problem. Boulder: Westview Press.
  • Armstrong, David M., and Norman Malcolm. 1984. Consciousness and Causality. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Byrne, Alex. 1997. “Some Like it HOT: Consciousness and Higher-Order Thoughts,” Philosophical Studies 86: 103-29.
  • Carruthers, Peter. 1989. “Brute Experience,” Journal of Philosophy 86, no. 5: 258-69.
  • Carruthers, Peter. 1996. Language, Thought and Consciousness: An Essay in Philosophical Psychology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Carruthers, Peter. 1999. “Sympathy and subjectivity,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy 77: 465-82.
  • Carruthers, Peter. 2000. Phenomenal Consciousness: A Naturalistic Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Chalmers, David J. 1996. The Conscious Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Dretske, Fred I. 1993. “Conscious Experience,” Mind 102, no. 406: 265-81.
  • Droege, Paula. 2003. Caging the Beast: A Theory of Sensory Consciousness. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing.
  • Gennaro, Rocco. 1996. Consciousness and Self-Consciousness: A Defense of the Higher-Order Thought Theory of Consciousness. Amsterdam: John Benjamins Publishing.
  • Gennaro, Rocco. Editor. 2004a. Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Gennaro, Rocco. 2004b. “Higher-Order Thoughts, Animal Consciousness, and Misrepresentation,” In Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness. Editor Rocco Gennaro, 45-66. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Güzeldere, Güven. 1995. “Is Consciousness the Perception of What Passes in One's Own Mind?” in Conscious Experience. Editor Thomas Metzinger, 335-58. Paderborn: Ferdinand Schoeningh.
  • Levine, Joseph. 1983. “Materialism and Qualia: The Explanatory Gap,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 64: 354-61.
  • Levine, Joseph. 2001. Purple Haze: The Puzzle of Consciousness. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Locke, John. 1689/1975. An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Editor Peter Nidditch. Oxford: Clarenden Press.
  • Lycan, William. 1987. Consciousness. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Lycan, William. 1996. Consciousness and Experience. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Lycan, William. 1998. “In Defense of the Representational Theory of Qualia,” in Language, Mind, and Ontology. Editor James E. Tomberlin, 479-87. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Lycan, William. 2001. “A Simple Argument for a Higher-Order Representation Theory of Consciousness,” Analysis 61, no. 1: 3-4.
  • Lycan, William. 2004. “The Superiority of HOP to HOT,” in Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness. Editor Rocco Gennaro, 93-114. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Moore, G. E. 1903. “The Refutation of Idealism,” Mind 12: 433-453.
  • Neander, Karen. 1998. “The Division of Phenomenal Labor: A Problem for Representational Theories of Consciousness,” In Language, Mind, and Ontology. Editor James E. Tomberlin, 411-34. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Rey, Georges. 1998. “A Narrow Representationalist Account of Qualitative Experience,” in Language, Mind, and Ontology. Editor James E. Tomberlin, 435-57. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1986. “Two Concepts of Consciousness,” Philosophical Studies 49, no. 3: 329-59.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1991. “The Independence of Consciousness and Sensory Quality,” in Consciousness. Editor Enrique Villanueva, 15-36. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1993a. “State Consciousness and Transitive Consciousness,” in Consciousness and Cognition 2: 355-63.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1993b. “Thinking that One Thinks,” in Consciousness: Psychological and Philosophical Essays . Editor Martin Davies and Glyn W. Humphreys, 197-223. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1997. “A Theory of Consciousness,” in The Nature of Consciousness: Philosophical Debates. Editors Ned Block, Owen Flanagan, and Güven Güzuldere, 729-54. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 1999. “The Colors and Shapes of Visual Experiences,” in Consciousness and Intentionality: Models and Modalities of Attribution. Editor Denis Fisette, 95-118. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 2002. “Explaining Consciousness,” in Philosophy of Mind: Classical and Contemporary Readings. Editor David Chalmers, 406-421. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 2004. “Varieties of Higher-Order Theory,” in Higher-Order Theories of Consciousness. Editor Rocco Gennaro, 17-44. Amsterdam: John Benjamins.
  • Rosenthal, David M. 2005 . Consciousness and Mind. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Author Information

Paula Droege
Pennsylvania State University
U. S. A.



In philosophy, egoism is the theory that one’s self is, or should be, the motivation and the goal of one’s own action. Egoism has two variants, descriptive or normative. The descriptive (or positive) variant conceives egoism as a factual description of human affairs. That is, people are motivated by their own interests and desires, and they cannot be described otherwise. The normative variant proposes that people should be so motivated, regardless of what presently motivates their behavior. Altruism is the opposite of egoism. The term “egoism” derives from “ego,” the Latin term for “I” in English. Egoism should be distinguished from egotism, which means a psychological overvaluation of one’s own importance, or of one’s own activities.

People act for many reasons; but for whom, or what, do or should they act—for themselves, for God, or for the good of the planet? Can an individual ever act only according to her own interests without regard for others’ interests. Conversely, can an individual ever truly act for others in complete disregard for her own interests? The answers will depend on an account of free will. Some philosophers argue that an individual has no choice in these matters, claiming that a person’s acts are determined by prior events which make illusory any belief in choice. Nevertheless, if an element of choice is permitted against the great causal impetus from nature, or God, it follows that a person possesses some control over her next action, and, that, therefore, one may inquire as to whether the individual does, or, should choose a self-or-other-oriented action. Morally speaking, one can ask whether the individual should pursue her own interests, or, whether she should reject self-interest and pursue others’ interest instead: to what extent are other-regarding acts morally praiseworthy compared to self-regarding acts?

Table of Contents

  1. Descriptive and Psychological Egoism
  2. Normative Egoism
    1. Rational Egoism
    2. Ethical Egoism
      1. Conditional Egoism
  3. Conclusion
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Descriptive and Psychological Egoism

The descriptive egoist’s theory is called “psychological egoism.” Psychological egoism describes human nature as being wholly self-centered and self-motivated. Examples of this explanation of human nature predate the formation of the theory, and, are found in writings such as that of British Victorian historian, Macaulay, and, in that of British Reformation political philosopher, Thomas Hobbes. To the question, “What proposition is there respecting human nature which is absolutely and universally true?", Macaulay, replies, "We know of only one . . . that men always act from self-interest." (Quoted in Garvin.) In Leviathan, Hobbes maintains that, "No man giveth but with intention of good to himself; because gift is voluntary; and of all voluntary acts the object to every man is his own pleasure." In its strong form, psychological egoism asserts that people always act in their own interests, and, cannot but act in their own interests, even though they may disguise their motivation with references to helping others or doing their duty.

Opponents claim that psychological egoism renders ethics useless. However, this accusation assumes that ethical behavior is necessarily other-regarding, which opponents would first have to establish. Opponents may also exploit counterfactual evidence to criticize psychological egoism— surely, they claim, there is a host of evidence supporting altruistic or duty bound actions that cannot be said to engage the self-interest of the agent. However, what qualifies to be counted as apparent counterfactual evidence by opponents becomes an intricate and debatable issue. This is because, in response to their opponents, psychological egoists may attempt to shift the question away from outward appearances to ultimate motives of acting benevolently towards others; for example, they may claim that seemingly altruistic behavior (giving a stranger some money) necessarily does have a self-interested component. For example, if the individual were not to offer aid to a stranger, he or she may feel guilty or may look bad in front of a peer group.

On this point, psychological egoism’s validity turns on examining and analyzing moral motivation. But since motivation is inherently private and inaccessible to others (an agent could be lying to herself or to others about the original motive), the theory shifts from a theoretical description of human nature--one that can be put to observational testing--to an assumption about the inner workings of human nature: psychological egoism moves beyond the possibility of empirical verification and the possibility of empirical negation (since motives are private), and therefore it becomes what is termed a “closed theory.”

A closed theory is a theory that rejects competing theories on its own terms and is non-verifiable and non-falsifiable. If psychological egoism is reduced to an assumption concerning human nature and its hidden motives, then it follows that it is just as valid to hold a competing theory of human motivation such as psychological altruism.

Psychological altruism holds that all human action is necessarily other-centered, and other-motivated. One’s becoming a hermit (an apparently selfish act) can be reinterpreted through psychological altruism as an act of pure noble selflessness: a hermit is not selfishly hiding herself away, rather, what she is doing is not inflicting her potentially ungraceful actions or displeasing looks upon others. A parallel analysis of psychological altruism thus results in opposing conclusions to psychological egoism. However, psychological altruism is arguably just as closed as psychological egoism: with it one assumes that an agent’s inherently private and consequently unverifiable motives are altruistic. If both theories can be validly maintained, and if the choice between them becomes the flip of a coin, then their soundness must be questioned.

A weak version of psychological egoism accepts the possibility of altruistic or benevolent behavior, but maintains that, whenever a choice is made by an agent to act, the action is by definition one that the agent wants to do at that point. The action is self-serving, and is therefore sufficiently explained by the theory of psychological egoism. Let one assume that person A wants to help the poor; therefore, A is acting egoistically by actually wanting to help; again, if A ran into a burning building to save a kitten, it must be the case that A wanted or desired to save the kitten. However, defining all motivations as what an agent desires to do remains problematic: logically, the theory becomes tautologous and therefore unable to provide a useful, descriptive meaning of motivation because one is essentially making an arguably philosophically uninteresting claim that an agent is motivated to do what she is motivated to do. Besides which, if helping others is what A desires to do, then to what extent can A be continued to be called an egoist? A acts because that is what A does, and consideration of the ethical “ought” becomes immediately redundant. Consequently, opponents argue that psychological egoism is philosophically inadequate because it sidesteps the great nuances of motive. For example, one can argue that the psychological egoist’s notion of motive sidesteps the clashes that her theory has with the notion of duty, and, related social virtues such as honor, respect, and reputation, which fill the tomes of history and literature.

David Hume, in his Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals (Appendix II—Of Self Love), offers six rebuttals of what he calls the “selfish hypothesis,” an arguably archaic relative of psychological egoism. First, Hume argues that self-interest opposes moral sentiments that may engage one in concern for others, and, may motivate one’s actions for others. These moral sentiments include love, friendship, compassion, and gratitude. Second, psychological egoism attempts to reduce human motivation to a single cause, which is a ‘fruitless’ task—the "love of simplicity…has been the source of much false reasoning in philosophy." Third, it is evident that animals act benevolently towards one another, and, if it is admitted that animals can act altruistically, then how can it be denied in humans? Fourth, the concepts we use to describe benevolent behavior cannot be meaningless; sometimes an agent obviously does not have a personal interest in the fortune of another, yet will wish her well. Any attempt to create an imaginary vested interest, as the psychological egoist will attempt, proves futile. Fifth, Hume asserts that we have prior motivations to self-interest; we may have, for example, a predisposition towards vanity, fame, or vengeance that transcends any benefit to the agent. Finally, Hume claims that even if the selfish hypothesis were true, there are a sufficient number of dispositions to generate a wide possibility of moral actions, allowing one person to be called vicious and another humane; and he claims that the latter is to be preferred over the former.

2. Normative Egoism

The second variant of egoism is normative in that it stipulates the agent ought to promote the self above other values. Herbert Spencer said, “Ethics has to recognize the truth, recognized in unethical thought, that egoism comes before altruism. The acts required for continued self-preservation, including the enjoyments of benefits achieved by such arts, are the first requisites to universal welfare. Unless each duly cares for himself, his care for all others is ended in death, and if each thus dies there remain no others to be cared for.” He was echoing a long history of the importance of self-regarding behavior that can be traced back to Aristotle’s theory of friendship in the Nichomachaean Ethics. In his theory, Aristotle argues that a man must befriend himself before he can befriend others. The general theory of normative egoism does not attempt to describe human nature directly, but asserts how people ought to behave. It comes in two general forms: rational egoism and ethical egoism.

a. Rational Egoism

Rational egoism claims that the promotion of one’s own interests is always in accordance with reason. The greatest and most provocative proponent of rational egoism is Ayn Rand, whose The Virtue of Selfishness outlines the logic and appeal of the theory. Rand argues that: first, properly defined, selfishness rejects the sacrificial ethics of the West’s Judaic-Christian heritage on the grounds that it is right for man to live his own life; and, Rand argues that, second, selfishness is a proper virtue to pursue. That being said, she rejects the “selfless selfishness” of irrationally acting individuals: “the actor must always be the beneficiary of his action and that man must act for his own rational self-interest.” To be ethically selfish thus entails a commitment to reason rather than to emotionally driven whims and instincts.

In the strong version of rational egoism defended by Rand, not only is it rational to pursue one’s own interests, it is irrational not to pursue them. In a weaker version, one may note that while it is rational to pursue one’s own interests, there may be occasions when not pursuing them is not necessarily irrational.

Critics of rational egoism may claim that reason may dictate that one’s interests should not govern one’s actions. The possibility of conflicting reasons in a society need not be evoked in this matter; one need only claim that reason may invoke an impartiality clause, in other words, a clause that demands that in a certain situation one’s interests should not be furthered. For example, consider a free-rider situation. In marking students’ papers, a teacher may argue that to offer inflated grades is to make her life easier, and, therefore, is in her self-interest: marking otherwise would incur negative feedback from students and having to spend time counseling on writing skills, and so on. It is even arguably foreseeable that inflating grades may never have negative consequences for anyone. The teacher could conceivably free-ride on the tougher marking of the rest of the department or university and not worry about the negative consequences of a diminished reputation to either. However, impartiality considerations demand an alternative course—it is not right to change grades to make life easier. Here self-interest conflicts with reason. Nonetheless, a Randian would reject the teacher’s free-riding being rational: since the teacher is employed to mark objectively and impartially in the first place, to do otherwise is to commit a fraud both against the employing institution and the student. (This is indeed an analogous situation explored in Rand’s The Fountainhead, in which the hero architect regrets having propped up a friend’s inabilities).

A simpler scenario may also be considered. Suppose that two men seek the hand of one woman, and they deduce that they should fight for her love. A critic may reason that the two men rationally claim that if one of them were vanquished, the other may enjoy the beloved. However, the solution ignores the woman’s right to choose between her suitors, and thus the men’s reasoning is flawed.

In a different scenario, game theory (emanating from John von Neumann’s and Oskar Morgenstern’s Theory of Games and Economic Behaviour, 1944) points to another possible logical error in rational egoism by offering an example in which the pursuit of self-interest results in both agents being made worse off.

This is famously described in the Prisoner’s Dilemma.

Prisoner B
Confess Don't confess

Prisoner A

Confess 5,5 ½,10
Don't Confess 10,½ 2,2

From the table, two criminals, A and B, face different sentences depending on whether they confess their guilt or not. Each prisoner does not know what his partner will choose and communication between the two prisoners is not permitted. There are no lawyers and presumably no humane interaction between the prisoners and their captors.

Rationally (i.e., from the point of view of the numbers involved), we can assume that both will want to minimize their sentences. Herein lies the rub - if both avoid confessing, they will serve 2 years each – a total of 4 years between them. If they both happen to confess, they each serve 5 years each, or 10 years between them.

However they both face a tantalizing option: if A confesses while his partner doesn’t confess, A can get away in 6 months leaving B to languish for 10 years (and the same is true for B): this would result in a collective total of 10.5 years served.

For the game, the optimal solution is assumed to be the lowest total years served, which would be both refusing to confess and each therefore serving 2 years each.
The probable outcome of the dilemma though is that both will confess in the desire to get off in 6 months, but therefore they will end up serving 10 years in total.
This is seen to be non-rational or sub-optimal for both prisoners as the total years served is not the best collective solution.

The Prisoner’s Dilemma offers a mathematical model as to why self-interested action could lead to a socially non-optimal equilibrium (in which the participants all end up in a worse scenario). To game theorists, many situations can be modeled in a similar way to the classic Prisoner’s Dilemma including issues of nuclear deterrence, environmental pollution, corporate advertising campaigns and even romantic dates.

Supporters identify a game “as any interaction between agents that is governed by a set of rules specifying the possible moves for each participant and a set of outcomes for each possible combination of moves.” They add: “One is hard put to find an example of social phenomenon that cannot be so described.” (Hargreaves-Heap and Varoufakis, p.1).

Nonetheless, it can be countered that the nature of the game artificially pre-empts other possibilities: the sentences are fixed not by the participants but by external force (the game masters), so the choices facing the agents are outside of their control. Although this may certainly be applied to the restricted choices facing the two prisoners or contestants in a game, it is not obvious that every-day life generates such limited and limiting choices. The prisoner’s dilemma is not to be repeated: so there are no further negotiations based on what the other side chose.

More importantly, games with such restricting options and results are entered into voluntarily and can be avoided (we can argue that the prisoners chose to engage in the game in that they chose to commit a crime and hence ran the possibility of being caught!). Outside of games, agents affect each other and the outcomes in many different ways and can hence vary the outcomes as they interact – in real life, communication involves altering the perception of how the world works, the values attached to different decisions, and hence what ought to be done and what potential consequences may arise.

In summary, even within the confines of the Prisoner’s Dilemma the assumptions that differing options be offered to each such that their self-interest works against the other can be challenged logically, ethically and judicially. Firstly, the collective outcomes of the game can be changed by the game master to produce a socially and individually optimal solution – the numbers can be altered. Secondly, presenting such a dilemma to the prisoners can be considered ethically and judicially questionable as the final sentence that each gets is dependent on what another party says, rather than on the guilt and deserved punished of the individual.

Interestingly, repeated games tested by psychologists and economists tend to present a range of solutions depending on the stakes and other rules, with Axelrod’s findings (The Evolution of Cooperation, 1984) indicating that egotistic action can work for mutual harmony under the principle of “tit for tat” – i.e., an understanding that giving something each creates a better outcome for both.

At a deeper level, some egoists may reject the possibility of fixed or absolute values that individuals acting selfishly and caught up in their own pursuits cannot see. Nietzsche, for instance, would counter that values are created by the individual and thereby do not stand independently of his or her self to be explained by another “authority”; similarly, St. Augustine would say “love, and do as you will”; neither of which may be helpful to the prisoners above but which may be of greater guidance for individuals in normal life.

Rand exhorts the application of reason to ethical situations, but a critic may reply that what is rational is not always the same as what is reasonable. The critic may emphasize the historicity of choice, that is, she may emphasize that one’s apparent choice is demarcated by, and dependent on, the particular language, culture of right and consequence and environmental circumstance in which an individual finds herself living: a Victorian English gentleman perceived a different moral sphere and consequently horizon of goals than an American frontiersman. This criticism may, however, turn on semantic or contextual nuances. The Randian may counter that what is rational is reasonable: for one can argue that rationality is governed as much by understanding the context (Sartre’s facticity is a highly useful term) as adhering to the laws of logic and of non-contradiction.

b. Ethical Egoism

Ethical egoism is the normative theory that the promotion of one’s own good is in accordance with morality. In the strong version, it is held that it is always moral to promote one’s own good, and it is never moral not to promote it. In the weak version, it is said that although it is always moral to promote one’s own good, it is not necessarily never moral to not. That is, there may be conditions in which the avoidance of personal interest may be a moral action.

In an imaginary construction of a world inhabited by a single being, it is possible that the pursuit of morality is the same as the pursuit of self-interest in that what is good for the agent is the same as what is in the agent’s interests. Arguably, there could never arise an occasion when the agent ought not to pursue self-interest in favor of another morality, unless he produces an alternative ethical system in which he ought to renounce his values in favor of an imaginary self, or, other entity such as the universe, or the agent’s God. Opponents of ethical egoism may claim, however, that although it is possible for this Robinson Crusoe type creature to lament previous choices as not conducive to self-interest (enjoying the pleasures of swimming all day, and not spending necessary time producing food), the mistake is not a moral mistake but a mistake of identifying self-interest. Presumably this lonely creature will begin to comprehend the distinctions between short, and long-term interests, and, that short-term pains can be countered by long-term gains.

In addition, opponents argue that even in a world inhabited by a single being, duties would still apply; (Kantian) duties are those actions that reason dictates ought to be pursued regardless of any gain, or loss to self or others. Further, the deontologist asserts the application of yet another moral sphere which ought to be pursued, namely, that of impartial duties. The problem with complicating the creature’s world with impartial duties, however, is in defining an impartial task in a purely subjective world. Impartiality, the ethical egoist may retort, could only exist where there are competing selves: otherwise, the attempt to be impartial in judging one’s actions is a redundant exercise. (However, the Cartesian rationalist could retort that need not be so, that a sentient being should act rationally, and reason will disclose what are the proper actions he should follow.)

If we move away from the imaginary construct of a single being’s world, ethical egoism comes under fire from more pertinent arguments. In complying with ethical egoism, the individual aims at her own greatest good. Ignoring a definition of the good for the present, it may justly be argued that pursuing one’s own greatest good can conflict with another’s pursuit, thus creating a situation of conflict. In a typical example, a young person may see his greatest good in murdering his rich uncle to inherit his millions. It is the rich uncle’s greatest good to continue enjoying his money, as he sees fit. According to detractors, conflict is an inherent problem of ethical egoism, and the model seemingly does not possess a conflict resolution system. With the additional premise of living in society, ethical egoism has much to respond to: obviously there are situations when two people’s greatest goods – the subjectively perceived working of their own self-interest – will conflict, and, a solution to such dilemmas is a necessary element of any theory attempting to provide an ethical system.

The ethical egoist contends that her theory, in fact, has resolutions to the conflict. The first resolution proceeds from a state of nature examination. If, in the wilderness, two people simultaneously come across the only source of drinkable water a potential dilemma arises if both make a simultaneous claim to it. With no recourse to arbitration they must either accept an equal share of the water, which would comply with rational egoism. (In other words, it is in the interest of both to share, for both may enjoy the water and each other’s company, and, if the water is inexhaustible, neither can gain from monopolizing the source.) But a critic may maintain that this solution is not necessarily in compliance with ethical egoism. Arguably, the critic continues, the two have no possible resolution, and must, therefore, fight for the water. This is often the line taken against egoism generally: that it results in insoluble conflict that implies, or necessitates a resort to force by one or both of the parties concerned. For the critic, the proffered resolution is, therefore, an acceptance of the ethical theory that “might is right;” that is, the critic maintains that the resolution accepts that the stronger will take possession and thereby gain proprietary rights.

However, ethical egoism does not have to logically result in a Darwinian struggle between the strong and the weak in which strength determines moral rectitude to resources or values. Indeed, the “realist” position may strike one as philosophically inadequate as that of psychological egoism, although popularly attractive. For example, instead of succumbing to insoluble conflict, the two people could cooperate (as rational egoism would require). Through cooperation, both agents would, thereby, mutually benefit from securing and sharing the resource. Against the critic’s pessimistic presumption that conflict is insoluble without recourse to victory, the ethical egoist can retort that reasoning people can recognize that their greatest interests are served more through cooperation than conflict. War is inherently costly, and, even the fighting beasts of the wild instinctively recognize its potential costs, and, have evolved conflict-avoiding strategies.

On the other hand, the ethical egoist can argue less benevolently, that in case one man reaches the desired resource first, he would then be able to take rightful control and possession of it – the second person cannot possess any right to it, except insofar as he may trade with its present owner. Of course, charitable considerations may motivate the owner to secure a share for the second comer, and economic considerations may prompt both to trade in those products that each can better produce or acquire: the one may guard the water supply from animals while the other hunts. Such would be a classical liberal reading of this situation, which considers the advance of property rights to be the obvious solution to apparently intractable conflicts over resources.

A second conflict-resolution stems from critics’ fears that ethical egoists could logically pursue their interests at the cost of others. Specifically, a critic may contend that personal gain logically cannot be in one’s best interest if it entails doing harm to another: doing harm to another would be to accept the principle that doing harm to another is ethical (that is, one would be equating “doing harm” with “one’s own best interests”), whereas, reflection shows that principle to be illogical on universalistic criteria. However, an ethical egoist may respond that in the case of the rich uncle and greedy nephew, for example, it is not the case that the nephew would be acting ethically by killing his uncle, and that for a critic to contend otherwise is to criticize personal gain from the separate ethical standpoint that condemns murder. In addition, the ethical egoist may respond by saying that these particular fears are based on a confusion resulting from conflating ethics (that is, self-interest) with personal gain; The ethical egoist may contend that if the nephew were to attempt to do harm for personal gain, that he would find that his uncle or others would or may be permitted to do harm in return. The argument that “I have a right to harm those who get in my way” is foiled by the argument that “others have a right to harm me should I get in the way.” That is, in the end, the nephew variously could see how harming another for personal gain would not be in his self-interest at all.

The critics’ fear is based on a misreading of ethical egoism, and is an attempt to subtly reinsert the “might is right” premise. Consequently, the ethical egoist is unfairly chastised on the basis of a straw-man argument. Ultimately, however, one comes to the conclusion reached in the discussion of the first resolution; that is, one must either accept the principle that might is right (which in most cases would be evidentially contrary to one’s best interest), or accept that cooperation with others is a more successful approach to improving one’s interests. Though interaction can either be violent or peaceful, an ethical egoist rejects violence as undermining the pursuit of self-interest.

A third conflict-resolution entails the insertion of rights as a standard. This resolution incorporates the conclusions of the first two resolutions by stating that there is an ethical framework that can logically be extrapolated from ethical egoism. However, the logical extrapolation is philosophically difficult (and, hence, intriguing) because ethical egoism is the theory that the promotion of one’s own self-interest is in accordance with morality whereas rights incorporate boundaries to behavior that reason or experience has shown to be contrary to the pursuit of self-interest. Although it is facile to argue that the greedy nephew does not have a right to claim his uncle’s money because it is not his but his uncle’s, and to claim that it is wrong to act aggressively against the person of another because that person has a legitimate right to live in peace (thus providing the substance of conflict-resolution for ethical egoism), the problem of expounding this theory for the ethical egoist lies in the intellectual arguments required to substantiate the claims for the existence of rights and then, once substantiated, connecting them to the pursuit of an individual’s greatest good.

i. Conditional Egoism

A final type of ethical egoism is conditional egoism. This is the theory that egoism is morally acceptable or right if it leads to morally acceptable ends. For example, self-interested behavior can be accepted and applauded if it leads to the betterment of society as a whole; the ultimate test rests not on acting self-interestedly but on whether society is improved as a result. A famous example of this kind of thinking is from Adam Smith’s The Wealth of Nations, in which Smith outlines the public benefits resulting from self-interested behavior (borrowing a theory from the earlier writer Bernard Mandeville and his Fable of the Bees). Smith writes: "It is not from the benevolence of the butcher, the brewer, or the baker, that we expect our dinner, but from their regard to their own interest. We address ourselves, not to their humanity but to their self-love, and never talk to them of our own necessities but of their advantages" (Wealth of Nations, I.ii.2).

As Smith himself admits, if egoistic behavior lends itself to society’s detriment, then it ought to be stopped. The theory of conditional egoism is thus dependent on a superior moral goal such as an action being in the common interest, that is, the public good. The grave problem facing conditional egoists is according to what standard ought the limits on egoism be placed? In other words, who or what is to define the nature of the public good? If it is a person who is set up as the great arbitrator of the public, then it is uncertain if there can be a guarantee that he or she is embodying or arguing for an impartial standard of the good and not for his or her own particular interest. If it is an impartial standard that sets the limit, one that can be indicated by any reasonable person, then it behooves the philosopher to explain the nature of that standard.

In most “public good” theories, the assumption is made that there exists a collective entity over and above the individuals that comprise it: race, nation, religion, and state being common examples. Collectivists then attempt to explain what in particular should be held as the interest of the group. Inevitably, however, conflict arises, and resolutions have to be produced. Some seek refuge in claiming the need for perpetual dialogue (rather than exchange), but others return to the need for force to settle apparently insoluble conflicts; nonetheless, the various shades of egoism pose a valid and appealing criticism of collectivism: that individuals act; groups don’t. Karl Popper’s works on methodological individualism are a useful source in criticizing collectivist thinking (for example, Popper’s The Poverty of Historicism).

3. Conclusion

Psychological egoism is fraught with the logical problem of collapsing into a closed theory, and hence being a mere assumption that could validly be accepted as describing human motivation and morality, or be rejected in favor of a psychological altruism (or even a psychological ecologism in which all actions necessarily benefit the agent’s environment).

Normative egoism, however, engages in a philosophically more intriguing dialogue with protractors. Normative egoists argue from various positions that an individual ought to pursue his or her own interest. These may be summarized as follows: the individual is best placed to know what defines that interest, or it is thoroughly the individual’s right to pursue that interest. The latter is divided into two sub-arguments: either because it is the reasonable/rational course of action, or because it is the best guarantee of maximizing social welfare.

Egoists also stress that the implication of critics’ condemnation of self-serving or self-motivating action is the call to renounce freedom in favor of control by others, who then are empowered to choose on their behalf. This entails an acceptance of Aristotle’s political maxim that "some are born to rule and others are born to be ruled," also read as "individuals are generally too stupid to act either in their own best interests or in the interests of those who would wish to command them." Rejecting both descriptions (the first as being arrogant and empirically questionable and the second as unmasking the truly immoral ambition lurking behind attacks on selfishness), egoists ironically can be read as moral and political egalitarians glorifying the dignity of each and every person to pursue life as they see fit. Mistakes in securing the proper means and appropriate ends will be made by individuals, but if they are morally responsible for their actions they not only will bear the consequences but also the opportunity for adapting and learning. When that responsibility is removed and individuals are exhorted to live for an alternative cause, their incentive and joy in improving their own welfare is concomitantly diminished, which will, for many egoists, ultimately foster an uncritical, unthinking mass of obedient bodies vulnerable to political manipulation: when the ego is trammeled, so too is freedom ensnared, and without freedom ethics is removed from individual to collective or government responsibility.

Egoists also reject the insight into personal motivation that others – whether they are psychological or sociological "experts" – declare they possess, and which they may accordingly fine-tune or encourage to "better ends." Why an individual acts remains an intrinsically personal and private act that is the stuff of memoirs and literature, but how they should act releases our investigations into ethics of what shall define the good for the self-regarding agent.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Aristotle. Nichomachaean Ethics. Various translations available. Book IX being most pertinent.
  • Baier, Kurt. “Egoisim” in A Companion to Ethics. Ed. Peter Singer. Blackwell: Oxford. 1990.
  • Feinberg, Joel. “Psychological Egoism” in Ethics: History, Theory, and Contemporary Issues. Oxford University Press: Oxford. 1998.
  • Garvin, Lucius. A Modern Introduction to Ethics. Houghton Mifflin: Cambrirdge, MA, 1953.
  • Hargreaves-Heap, Shaun P. and Yanis Varoufakis. Game Theory: A Critical Introduction. Routledge: London, 1995.
  • Holmes, S.J. Life and Morals. MacMillan: London, 1948.
  • Hospers, John. “Ethical Egoism,” in An Introduction to Philosophical Analysis. 2nd Edition. Routledge, Kegan Paul: London, 1967.
  • Hume, David. Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals.
  • Peikoff, Leonard. Objectivism: The Philosophy of Ayn Rand. Meridian: London, 1993.
  • Popper, Karl. Poverty of Historicism. Routledge & Kegan Paul: London, 1976.
  • Rachels, James. Elements of Moral Philosophy. Mcgraw-Hill: London, 1995.
  • Rand, Ayn. Virtue of Selfishness. Signet: New York, 1964.
  • Rand, Ayn. The Fountainhead. Harper Collins: New York. 1961.
  • Sidgwick, Henry. The Methods of Ethics. MacMillan: London, 1901.
  • Smith, Adam. Wealth of Nations.
  • Smith, Adam. Theory of Moral Sentiments.

Author Information

Alexander Moseley
United Kingdom

Plato: Theaetetus

Plato: Theaetetus

platoThe Theaetetus is one of the middle to later dialogues of the ancient Greek philosopher Plato. Plato was Socrates’ student and Aristotle’s teacher. As in most of Plato’s dialogues, the main character is Socrates. In the Theaetetus, Socrates converses with Theaetetus, a boy, and Theodorus, his mathematics teacher. Although this dialogue features Plato’s most sustained discussion on the concept of knowledge, it fails to yield an adequate definition of knowledge, thus ending inconclusively. Despite this lack of a positive definition, the Theaetetus has been the source of endless scholarly fascination. In addition to its main emphasis on the nature of cognition, it considers a wide variety of philosophical issues: the Socratic Dialectic, Heraclitean Flux, Protagorean Relativism, rhetorical versus philosophical life, and false judgment. These issues are also discussed in other Platonic dialogues.

The Theaetetus poses a special difficulty for Plato scholars trying to interpret the dialogue: in light of Plato’s metaphysical and epistemological commitments, expounded in earlier dialogues such as the Republic, the Forms are the only suitable objects of knowledge, and yet the Theaetetus fails explicitly to acknowledge them. Might this failure mean that Plato has lost faith in the Forms, as the Parmenides suggests, or is this omission of the Forms a calculated move on Plato’s part to show that knowledge is indeed indefinable without a proper acknowledgement of the Forms? Scholars have also been puzzled by the picture of the philosopher painted by Socrates in the digression: there the philosopher emerges as a man indifferent to the affairs of the city and concerned solely with “becoming as much godlike as possible.” What does this version of the philosophic life have to do with a city-bound Socrates whose chief concern was to benefit his fellow citizens? These are only two of the questions that have preoccupied Plato scholars in their attempt to interpret this highly complex dialogue.

Table of Contents

  1. The Characters of Plato’s Theaetetus
  2. Date of Composition
  3. Outline of the Dialogue
    1. Knowledge as Arts and Sciences (146c – 151d)
    2. Knowledge as Perception (151d – 186e)
    3. Knowledge as True Judgment (187a – 201c)
    4. Knowledge as True Judgment with Logos (201c – 210d)
  4. References and Further Reading
    1. General Commentaries
    2. Knowledge as Arts and Sciences
    3. Knowledge as Perception
    4. Knowledge as True Judgment
    5. Knowledge as True Judgment with Logos

1. The Characters of Plato’s Theaetetus

In the Theaetetus, Socrates converses with two mathematicians, Theaetetus and Theodorus. Theaetetus is portrayed as a physically ugly but extraordinarily astute boy, and Theodorus is his mathematics teacher. According to the Oxford Classical Dictionary, Theaetetus lived in Athens (c. 415–369 BCE) and was a renowned geometer. He is credited with the theory of irrational lines, a contribution of fundamental importance for Euclid’s Elements X. He also worked out constructions of the regular solids like those in Elements XIII. Theodorus lived in Cyrene in the late fifth century BCE. In the dialogue, he is portrayed as a friend of Protagoras, well-aware of the Sophist’s teachings, and quite unfamiliar with the intricacies of Socratic Dialectic. As far as his scientific work is concerned, the only existing source is Plato’s Theaetetus: In the dialogue, Theodorus is portrayed as having shown the irrationality of the square roots of 3, 5, 6, 7, ... ,17.  Irrational numbers are numbers equal to an ordinary fraction, a fraction that has whole numbers in its numerator and denominator. The passage has been interpreted in many different ways, and its historical accuracy has been disputed.

2. Date of Composition

The introduction of the dialogue informs the reader that Theaetetus is being carried home dying of wounds and dysentery after a battle near Corinth. There are two known battles that are possibly the one referred to in the dialogue: the first one took place at about 394 BCE, and the other occurred at around 369 BCE. Scholars commonly prefer the battle of 369 BCE as the battle referred to in the dialogue. The dialogue is a tribute to Theaetetus’ memory and was probably written shortly after his death, which most scholars date around 369 – 367 BCE. It is uncontroversial that the Theaetetus, the Sophist and the Statesman were written in that order. The primary evidence for this order is that the Sophist begins with a reference back to the Theaetetus and a reference forward to the Statesman. In addition, there is a number of thematic continuities between the Theaetetus and the Sophist (for instance, the concept of “false belief,” and the notions of “being,” “sameness,” and “difference”) and between the Sophist and the Statesman (such as the use of the method of “collection and division”).

3. Outline of the Dialogue

The dialogue examines the question, “What is knowledge (episteme)?” For heuristic purposes, it can be divided into four sections, in which a different answer to this question is examined: (i) Knowledge is the various arts and sciences; (ii) Knowledge is perception; (iii) Knowledge is true judgment; and (iv) Knowledge is true judgment with an “account” (Logos). The dialogue itself is prefaced by a conversation between Terpsion and Euclid, in the latter’s house in Megara. From this conversation we learn about Theaetetus’ wounds and impending death and about Socrates’ prophecy regarding the future of the young man. In addition, we learn about the dialogue’s recording method: Euclid had heard the entire conversation from Socrates, he then wrote down his memoirs of the conversation, while checking the details with Socrates on subsequent visits to Athens. Euclid’s role did not consist simply in writing down Socrates’ memorized version of the actual dialogue; he also chose to cast it in direct dialogue, as opposed to narrative form, leaving out such connecting sentences as “and I said” and “he agreed.” Finally, Euclid’s product is read for him and for Terpsion by a slave. This is the only Platonic dialogue which is being read by a slave.

a. Knowledge as Arts and Sciences (146c – 151d)

To Socrates’ question, “What is knowledge?,” Theaetetus responds by giving a list of examples of knowledge, namely geometry, astronomy, harmonics, and arithmetic, as well as the crafts or skills (technai) of cobbling and so on (146c–d). These he calls “knowledges,” presumably thinking of them as the various branches of knowledge. As Socrates correctly observes, Theaetetus’ answer provides a list of instances of things of which there is knowledge. Socrates states three complaints against this response: (a) what he is interested in is the one thing common to all the various examples of knowledge, not a multiplicity of different kinds of knowledge; (b) Theaetetus’ response is circular, because even if one knows that, say, cobbling is “knowledge of how to make shoes,” one cannot know what cobbling is, unless one knows what knowledge is; (c) The youth’s answer is needlessly long-winded, a short formula is all that is required. The definition of clay as “earth mixed with water,” which is also evoked by Aristotle in Topics 127a, is representative of the type of definition needed here. Theaetetus offers the following mathematical example to show that he understands Socrates’ definitional requirements: the geometrical equivalents of what are now called “surds” could be grouped in one class and given a single name (“powers”) by dint of their common characteristic of irrationality or incommensurability. When he tries to apply the same method to the question about knowledge, however, Theaetetus does not know how to proceed. In a justly celebrated image, Socrates, like an intellectual midwife, undertakes to assist him in giving birth to his ideas and in judging whether or not they are legitimate children. Socrates has the ability to determine who is mentally pregnant, by knowing how to use “medicine” and “incantations” to induce mental labor. Socrates also has the ability to tell in whose company a young man may benefit academically. This latter skill is not one that ordinary midwives seem to have, but Socrates insists that they are the most reliable matchmakers, and in order to prove his assertion he draws upon an agricultural analogy: just as the farmer not only tends and harvests the fruits of the earth, but also knows which kind of earth is best for planting various kinds of seed, so the midwife’s art should include a knowledge of both “sowing” and “harvesting.” But unlike common midwives, Socrates’ art deals with the soul and enables him to distinguish and embrace true beliefs rather than false beliefs. By combining the technê of the midwife with that of the farmer, Socrates provides in the Theaetetus the most celebrated analogy for his own philosophical practice.

b. Knowledge as Perception (151d – 186e)

Encouraged by Socrates’ maieutic intervention, Theaetetus comes up with a serious proposal for a definition: knowledge is perception. Satisfied with at least the form of this definition, Socrates immediately converts it into Protagoras’ homo-mensura doctrine, “Man is the measure of all things, of the things that are that [or how] they are, of the things that are not that [or how] they are not.” The Protagorean thesis underscores the alleged fact that perception is not only an infallible but also the sole form of cognition, thereby bringing out the implicit assumptions of Theaetetus’ general definition. Socrates effects the complete identity between knowledge and perception by bringing together two theses: (a) the interpretation of Protagoras’ doctrine as meaning “how things appear to an individual is how they are for that individual” (e.g., “if the wind appears cold to X, then it is cold for X”); and (b) the equivalence of “Y appears F to X” with “X perceives Y as F” (e.g., “the wind appears cold to Socrates” with “Socrates perceives the wind as cold”). His next move is to build the ontological foundation of a world that guarantees perceptual infallibility. For that, Socrates turns to the Heraclitean postulate of Radical Flux, which he attributes to Protagoras as his Secret Doctrine. Nearly all commentators acknowledge that Protagoras’ secret teaching is unlikely to be a historically accurate representation of either Protagoras’ ontological commitments or Heraclitus’ Flux doctrine. The notion of Universal Flux makes every visual event—for example the visual perception of whiteness—the private and unique product of interaction between an individual’s eyes and an external motion. Later this privacy is explained with the metaphor of the perceiver and the perceived object as parents birthing a twin offspring, the object’s whiteness and the subject’s corresponding perception of it. Both parents and offspring are unique and unrepeatable: there can be no other, identical interaction between either the same parents or different parents able to produce the same offspring. No two perceptions can thus ever be in conflict with each other, and no one can ever refute anyone else’s perceptual judgments, since these are the products of instantaneous perceptual relations, obtaining between ever-changing perceiving subjects and ever-changing perceived objects. Although the assimilation of Protagorean Relativism to Theaetetus’ definition requires the application of the doctrine to Perceptual Relativism—which explains Socrates’ extensive focus on the mechanics of perception—one should bear in mind that the man-as-measure thesis is broader in scope, encompassing all judgments, especially judgments concerning values, such as “the just” and “the good,” and not just narrowly sensory impressions. Socrates launches a critique against both interpretations of Protagoreanism, beginning with its broad—moral and epistemological—dimensions, and concluding with its narrow, perceptual aspects.

Socrates attacks broad Protagoreanism from within the standpoint afforded him by three main arguments. First, Socrates asks how, if people are each a measure of their own truth, some, among whom is Protagoras himself, can be wiser than others. The same argument appears in Cratylus 385e–386d as a sufficient refutation of the homo-mensura doctrine. The Sophists’ imagined answer evinces a new conceptualization of wisdom: the wisdom of a teacher like Protagoras has nothing to do with truth, instead it lies in the fact that he can better the way things appear to other people, just as the expert doctor makes the patient feel well by making his food taste sweet rather than bitter, the farmer restores health to sickly plants by making them feel better, and the educator “changes a worse state into a better state” by means of words (167a).

The second critique of Protagoras is the famous self-refutation argument. It is essentially a two-pronged argument: the first part revolves around false beliefs, while the second part, which builds on the findings of the first, threatens the validity of the man-as-measure doctrine. The former can be sketched as follows: (1) many people believe that there are false beliefs; therefore, (2) if all beliefs are true, there are [per (1)] false beliefs; (3) if not all beliefs are true, there are false beliefs; (4) therefore, either way, there are false beliefs (169d–170c). The existence of false beliefs is inconsistent with the homo-mensura doctrine, and hence, if there are false beliefs, Protagoras’ “truth” is false. But since the homo-mensura doctrine proclaims that all beliefs are true, if there are false beliefs, then the doctrine is manifestly untenable. The latter part of Socrates’ second critique is much bolder—being called by Socrates “the most subtle argument”—as it aims to undermine Protagoras’ own commitment to relativism from within the relativist framework itself (170e–171c). At the beginning of this critique Socrates asserts that, according to the doctrine under attack, if you believe something to be the case but thousands disagree with you about it, that thing is true for you but false for the thousands. Then he wonders what the case for Protagoras himself is. If not even he believed that man is the measure, and the many did not either (as indeed they do not), this “truth” that he wrote about is true for no one. If, on the other hand, he himself believed it, but the masses do not agree, the extent to which those who do not think so exceed those who do, to that same extent it is not so more than it is so. Subsequently, Socrates adds his “most subtle” point: Protagoras agrees, regarding his own view, that the opinion of those who think he is wrong is true, since he agrees that everybody believes things that are so. On the basis of this, he would have to agree that his own view is false. On the other hand, the others do not agree that they are wrong, and Protagoras is bound to agree, on the basis of his own doctrine, that their belief is true. The conclusion, Socrates states, inevitably undermines the validity of the Protagorean thesis: if Protagoras’ opponents think that their disbelief in the homo-mensura doctrine is true and Protagoras himself must grant the veracity of that belief, then the truth of the Protagorean theory is disputed by everyone, including Protagoras himself.

In the famous digression (172a–177c), which separates the second from the third argument against broad Protagoreanism, Socrates sets up a dichotomy between the judicial and the philosophical realm: those thought of as worldly experts in issues of justice are blind followers of legal practicalities, while the philosophical mind, being unrestricted by temporal or spatial limitations, is free to investigate the true essence of justice. Civic justice is concerned with the here-and-now and presupposes a mechanical absorption of rules and regulations, whereas philosophical examination leads to an understanding of justice as an absolute, non-relativistic value. This dichotomy between temporal and a-temporal justice rests on a more fundamental conceptual opposition between a civic morality and a godlike distancing from civic preoccupations. Godlikeness, Socrates contends, requires a certain degree of withdrawal from earthly affairs and an attempt to emulate divine intelligence and morality. The otherworldliness of the digression has attracted the attention of, among others, Aristotle, in Nicomachean Ethics X 7, and Plotinus, who in Enneads I 2, offers an extended commentary of the text.

In his third argument against broad Protagoreanism, Socrates exposes the flawed nature of Protagoras’ definition of expertise, as a skill that points out what is beneficial, by contrasting sensible properties—such as hot, which may indeed be immune to interpersonal correction—and values, like the good and the beneficial, whose essence is independent from individual appearances. The reason for this, Socrates argues, is that the content of value-judgments is properly assessed by reference to how things will turn out in the future. Experts are thus people who have the capacity to foresee the future effects of present causes. One may be an infallible judge of whether one is hot now, but only the expert physician is able accurately to tell today whether one will be feverish tomorrow. Thus the predictive powers of expertise cast the last blow on the moral and epistemological dimensions of Protagorean Relativism.

In order to attack narrow Protagoreanism, which fully identifies knowledge with perception, Socrates proposes to investigate the doctrine’s Heraclitean underpinnings. The question he now poses is: how radical does the Flux to which the Heracliteans are committed to must be in order for the definition of knowledge as perception to emerge as coherent and plausible? His answer is that the nature of Flux that sanctions Theaetetus’ account must be very radical, indeed too radical for the definition itself to be either expressible or defensible. As we saw earlier, the Secret Doctrine postulated two kinds of motion: the parents of the perceptual event undergo qualitative change, while its twin offspring undergoes locomotive change. To the question whether the Heracliteans will grant that everything undergoes both kinds of change, Socrates replies in the affirmative because, were that not the case, both change and stability would be observed in the Heraclitean world of Flux. If then everything is characterized by all kinds of change at all times, what can we say about anything? The answer is “nothing” because the referents of our discourse would be constantly shifting, and thus we would be deprived of the ability to formulate any words at all about anything. Consequently, Theaetetus’ i