Category Archives: Metaphysics & Epistemology

Naturalistic Epistemology

Naturalistic epistemology is an approach to the theory of knowledge that emphasizes the application of methods, results, and theories from the empirical sciences. It contrasts with approaches that emphasize a priori conceptual analysis or insist on a theory of knowledge that is independent of the particular scientific details of how mind-brains work.

Varieties of naturalistic epistemology differ in terms of how they conceive the relationship between empirical science and epistemology, how much they rely on empirical science in theorizing about knowledge, and which sciences they take to be particularly relevant to epistemological questions. Naturalistic epistemologists such as W.V. Quine regard epistemology as part of psychology while others such as Alvin Goldman think it merely needs aid from the empirical sciences. On the other hand, Thomas Kuhn thinks that the social sciences should be applied to epistemology. Regardless, the importance of the sciences to epistemology is undisputed among naturalistic epistemologists.

Among the topics within this discipline, the debate on the internal and external theories for the justification of beliefs is one of the main issues. Donald Davidson and John Pollock are major naturalistic epistemologists that support internalism. Alvin Goldman, on the other hand, supports externalism. The issue of a priori knowledge and the problem of induction are also topics for debate within naturalistic epistemology.

Lastly, naturalistic epistemology is not without criticism. Among the problems for naturalistic epistemology are the circularity problem and the problem of normativity. With regard to the aims of unifying science and philosophy, solutions to these problems are of crucial importance for naturalistic epistemologists.

Table of Contents

  1. Key Figures in Naturalistic Epistemology
    1. W. V. Quine
    2. Alvin Goldman
    3. Thomas Kuhn
  2. Naturalistic Epistemology and Current Controversies
    1. Internalism and Externalism
    2. A priori Knowledge
    3. The Problem of Induction
  3. Problems for Naturalistic Epistemology
    1. The Circularity Problem
    2. The Problem of Normativity
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Key Figures in Naturalistic Epistemology

a. W. V. Quine

W. V. Quine usually gets credit for initiating the contemporary wave of naturalistic epistemology with his essay, "Epistemology Naturalized." In that essay, he argues for conceiving epistemology as a "chapter of psychology," and for seeing epistemology and empirical science as containing and constraining one another.

Quine's argument depends on three potentially controversial assumptions. First is confirmation holism - the view that only substantial bodies of theory, rather than individual claims, are empirically testable. Second, Quine assumes epistemology's main problem is to explain the relationship between theories and their observational evidence. Third, he assumes there are only two ways to approach that problem. One is the psychological study of how people produce theoretical "output" from sensory “input,” and the other is the logical reconstruction of our theoretical vocabulary in sensory terms. In Quine's view, the second approach cannot succeed, and so we are left with psychology.

The idea behind reconstructing theoretical vocabulary in sensory terms is to model epistemology on studies in the foundations of mathematics. Such studies show how to translate mathematical statements into the language of logic and set theory, and they show how to deduce suitably translated mathematical theorems from logical truths and set theoretic axioms. This allows us to judge the strength of our justification in believing mathematical claims: we are as justified in believing them as we are in believing the logical truths and set-theoretic axioms.

Logical Empiricists such as Rudolf Carnap sought a similar account of our justification for believing scientific theories. Given a translation of theoretical claims into observational vocabulary, we might be able to show how our theories could be derived logically from observation sentences, logical truths, and set theory.

Such a project could not be a complete success. For one thing (as Carnap was well aware), our theories cannot be derived logically from observations - the theories include generalizations covering unobserved cases. Nevertheless, such philosophers as Carnap thought the translation of theory into observational terms would be useful. It would allow us to see just how far our theories outstrip their observational evidence.

Quine emphasizes a second reason why the reconstructive approach must fail: Theoretical statements cannot, in general, be translated into purely observational vocabulary. To effect such translations, we would need to identify the observational conditions of verification (or disconfirmation) for individual theoretical statements. But, as Quine argues in his other most famous essay, "Two Dogmas of Empiricism," individual theoretical statements do not have unique conditions of verification (or disconfirmation). Rather, we must test theoretical statements in groups large enough to have observational consequences, and the results confirm or disconfirm the groups as wholes. When the observations a theory predicts do not pan out, there is typically a wide range of adjustments we could make in response. We might, for example, give up the claim that this liquid is an acid, or the claim that this is a piece of litmus paper, or the claim we are not hallucinating, and so forth.

So, Quine's assumption of confirmation holism undermines the possibility of reconstructing theoretical vocabulary in observational terms. Consequently, the reconstructionist approach cannot succeed. Given Quine's other assumptions, then, the only method left for epistemology is the psychological method: to study empirically how people transform sensory input into theoretical output.

Knowledge thus approached is a natural phenomenon, the outcome of a natural process whereby sensory stimulation leads to theories about the world. To understand the connection between the stimulation and the theories - and to understand how far beyond the stimulation our theories go - we study the process scientifically. The point is not to "reconstruct" the transition, but to understand it as it actually occurs.

Quinian naturalistic epistemology is thus "contained" in psychology as a subdiscipline. Quine also notes, however, that there is a sense in which naturalistic epistemology "contains" the rest of science. Our theories and beliefs about the world, which constitute our science, are part of epistemology's subject matter. Because they "contain" one another, epistemology and the rest of science can be mutually constraining. Not only should our scientific theories pass epistemic muster, but our epistemological theories must fit appropriately with the rest of our scientific worldview. This conception of the relationship between science and epistemology contrasts vividly with the traditional view of epistemology as "queen of the sciences." It is probably the most influential aspect of Quine's naturalism.

b. Alvin Goldman

Unlike Quine, Alvin Goldman is concerned with such traditional epistemological problems as developing an adequate theoretical understanding of knowledge and justified believing. Also in contrast to Quine, he does not see epistemology as part of science. Instead, Goldman thinks that answering traditional epistemological questions requires both a priori philosophy and the application of scientific results. As he often puts it, Goldman's naturalism is the view that epistemology "needs help" from science.

Goldman's theory of knowledge is a form of causal reliabilism. On such a view, a justified true belief counts as knowledge only if it is caused in a suitably reliable way. To be "suitably reliable," a belief-forming process must have a propensity to produce more true beliefs than false ones, and the process's own causal ancestry must have a greater propensity to produce reliable processes than unreliable ones. Though Goldman argues for this view of knowledge on primarily a priori grounds - for example, by considering how well it captures our intuitive classifications of beliefs as cases of knowledge or not - the theory itself gives empirical science an important place in our understanding of knowledge.

The most obvious place where psychology matters in this theory of knowledge is in the identification and evaluation of belief-forming processes. It is psychology that tells us what processes cause our beliefs, and it is psychology that enables us to judge their reliability. Consequently, the determination whether a particular belief is a case of knowledge will turn on both philosophical and psychological considerations. Philosophically, we can say that the belief (if justified and true) is knowledge if it was caused in a suitably reliable way. The question whether it was caused in such a way, however, is a question for empirical science.

A related role for psychology is in addressing skeptical problems. If true, causal reliabilism shows only that knowledge is logically possible. (It is logically possible for a person to have justified, true beliefs caused by suitably reliable processes.) The question whether knowledge is humanly possible, and the question whether anyone actually knows anything, are both questions whose answers depend on which cognitive processes are available to humans, and on how reliable those processes are.

Goldman's approach to epistemic justification is also reliabilist and grounded in science. The core of his view is that justification is at least partly a matter of beliefs' being produced by reliable cognitive processes. Goldman has made numerous modifications to this view, and he has worked out its details in various ways at different times.

The account of justification Goldman now favors has two components. First, he thinks it is an important task of epistemology to clarify and describe our "epistemic folkways," the set of our commonsense epistemological concepts and principles, including the concept of justified belief. The second component is a theory of what justified believing is, based on the principles underlying our commonsense judgments but perhaps departing from those judgments in certain cases.

To study our epistemic folkways, Goldman thinks it is necessary to examine empirically the ways in which we apply and acquire our epistemic concepts, in hopes of determining those concepts' structures. He hypothesizes that we apply epistemic concepts to individual cases in much the same way we apply most of our concepts: by judging how similar or different a particular case is to stereotypical instances of the concept. In the case of epistemic justification, he thinks we compare the process whereby a person has come to believe something with what we take to be typical justification-conferring processes, such as perception or deduction. He contends that we take such processes to confer justification because we take them to be reliable.

Our commonsense understanding of what processes people use to arrive at their beliefs, and our commonsense assessments of their reliability, are apt to be quite different from the psychological truth of the matter. So, in Goldman's view, it is necessary also to construct a theory of what epistemic justification really is, as opposed to how common sense takes it to be. That theory will be grounded in our psychological understanding of how beliefs are formed, and it will include assessments of those processes in terms of reliability (as well as problem-solving power and speed, though Goldman thinks those assessments are only loosely connected to justification, if at all).

c. Thomas Kuhn

Much naturalistic epistemology looks to psychology and, in certain cases, the natural sciences to develop an understanding of knowledge. Especially in the philosophy of science, however, Thomas Kuhn's work has inspired a naturalistic approach that applies the social sciences to epistemological questions. Kuhn-inspired naturalism is not incompatible with the naturalism that draws on psychology and the natural sciences. Such naturalistic epistemologists as Alvin Goldman and Philip Kitcher have fruitfully applied insights from both the natural and the social sciences in the attempt to understand knowledge as a simultaneously cognitive and social phenomenon.

In his highly influential book, The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Kuhn carefully examines the process of theory change in science. Unlike earlier approaches, which might, in Carnapian style, have tried to reconstruct theory changes as driven entirely by evidence, Kuhn emphasizes how rare it is that scientists reject old theories in favor of new ones on the basis of data alone. Especially in the case of "revolutionary" changes - such as the transition from Ptolemaic to Copernican astronomy – the data available to scientists can be highly ambiguous, and the data often fail to establish determinately what theoretical framework should win out.

On Kuhn's view, scientific practice is guided by paradigms - theories, methodologies, and conceptual frameworks that give scientists examples of "good science" and shape their understanding not only of the world, but of what science itself is supposed to be like. As paradigms age, however, they build up not only a record of explanatory and predictive success, but also a record of failures and unsolved problems. Revolutions occur when scientists come to see some of the unsolved problems as both very important and unsolvable from within the reigning paradigms. New paradigms emerge, and debates rage about whether to adopt them or to stick to the old way of doing things, in hopes of eventually solving the threatening problems.

Debates about whether to give up on an old paradigm, Kuhn emphasizes, cannot be settled by the available data. One reason for this is that paradigms help scientists to decide what will and what will not count as data, and they help to determine scientists' judgments about the import or interpretation of data. Furthermore, it is at most only rarely that a newly proposed paradigm is incremental in the sense that it provides solutions to all or most of the problems solved by the old paradigm, as well as the new problems that have raised questions about the old paradigm. For example, Kuhn attacks the common view that Newtonian mechanics is a limiting case of Relativistic mechanics. Relativity, on his view, does not solve all the Newtonian problems and others besides. Rather, it replaces the old problems with new ones it can solve. Adopting a new paradigm, in such cases, is more like changing the subject than being compelled by the rational force of evidence.

Kuhn attempts to trace the social and political factors behind theory changes in science. The available data do not unequivocally favor one paradigm over others, and scientists do not choose paradigms on the basis of data. Instead, Kuhn believes social and political forces guide paradigm changes. Thus, an adequate explanation of scientific revolutions will be an application of social, political, and historical analysis, not the logical analysis of the relationship between theories and evidence. To understand science in Kuhnian fashion, it is at least as important to understand scientists and what they do as it is to understand the theories they offer and the experiments they conduct.

Kuhn's dual emphases on socio-political factors in theory choice and understanding science by studying the practices of scientists have led to several different strands of Kuhn-inspired naturalistic philosophy of science.

The most radical strand is the so-called "sociology of scientific knowledge," often identified with the "strong programme" of David Bloor. At the heart of this program is a "symmetry principle," to the effect that true and false, rational and irrational scientific beliefs are to be explained in the same way. The explanation of scientific beliefs is thus to be indifferent to the actual truth of those beliefs. This agnosticism about the truth of scientific theories leads strong programme advocates to attempt to explain almost everything scientists do and say in sociological terms, specifically avoiding any appeals to how the extra-social world is in explaining scientists' behavior. The official agnosticism also sometimes appears to transform itself into a form of constructivism, the view that scientists and others make the world be as it is by adopting theories, instead of the world determining (at least partly) what theories scientists will or should adopt.

A much less radical strand of Kuhn-inspired philosophy of science (which also owes a debt to Quine) is to be found in the work of Larry Laudan. He offers a "reticulated model" of science, in which issues concerning scientific theories, scientific methods, and scientific aims interact with one another. On this model, theories are not adopted independently of methodological and axiological commitments, but neither are those commitments undertaken independently of theoretical commitments. As one would expect from a naturalist, much of Laudan's case turns on details concerning the actual unfolding of the history of science.

In a somewhat similar spirit, such philosophers as Philip Kitcher and Alvin Goldman have advocated a "social epistemology" partly inspired by Kuhn. A psychological fact about the conduct of science is that it is not the mere construction of theories in the face of evidence. Rather, it is the construction of theories both in the face of evidence and from within a social context. Scientists' theory choices thus depend on what evidence they gather and also on social and political factors, including the organization of the social structures in which they pursue knowledge. To understand how science happens, then, one must understand those social structures. As Kitcher and Goldman emphasize, however, those structures themselves can be evaluated in reliabilist terms; we can ask (and try to find out) how well a given social structure promotes the aim of producing true theories rather than false ones. Kitcher and Goldman have attempted to answer such questions, and to describe what kinds of social structures would be most conducive to the promotion of our epistemic and scientific goals.

2. Naturalistic Epistemology and Current Controversies

Because naturalistic epistemologies can differ from one another so much, there is rarely a single or standard "naturalistic" approach to an issue in epistemology. Instead, different naturalists will take different approaches, depending on their precise views of the relationship between science and epistemology. This section describes some naturalistic approaches to three current issues in epistemology: the internalism/externalism debate, the problem of a priori knowledge, and the problem of induction.

a. Internalism and Externalism

The debate between internalists and externalists concerns whether anything besides mental states helps to constitute the justification of beliefs. Internalists hold that a belief is justified only if it is appropriately related to other mental states, and externalists hold that justification comes at least partly from elsewhere, for example from the reliability of the process that generated a belief.

Naturalistic epistemology is not committed to either internalism or externalism. Many, perhaps most, naturalistic epistemologists endorse reliabilist theories of justification or knowledge, and so they are externalists. Goldman in particular has been a standard-bearer for externalism.

Among naturalistic epistemologists who endorse internalism are Donald Davidson and John Pollock. Davidson's naturalism is fairly weak, in the sense that Davidson does not directly apply much hard science to epistemological problems. Nevertheless, he does take seriously Quine's admonition that epistemology is just one part of our going theory of the world, and he feels free to take for granted such things as the existence of the external world when it comes to explaining how we could have knowledge concerning the external world. He also holds that only another belief can justify a belief, and he thus sees justification as arising from the relationships among one's beliefs.

Pollock endorses a view he calls "norm internalism." He holds that beliefs are justified when formed in accord with certain internalized rules concerning the correct ways to form beliefs. Those internalized rules are, in his term, "psychologically real," contingent features of our cognitive architecture. Nevertheless, he also thinks that experimental studies of reasoning will not be very helpful in determining the contents of the internalized rules. Rather, he thinks the best way to learn their contents is by examining our intuitions about what counts as knowledge or justified belief and what does not.

b. A priori Knowledge

A priori knowledge, if there is any, is knowledge obtained independently of experience. Quine denies there is a priori knowledge. To know something a priori, he thinks, it would have to be analytic (that is, true in virtue of the meanings of the concepts involved), but there is no analyticity. This rejection of the a priori and analyticity is part of the package that includes Quine's confirmation holism. In fact, Quine claims in "Two Dogmas of Empiricism" that his anti-reductionism (that is, his confirmation holism) is really the same thing as his rejection of analytic truth and a priori knowledge. It is unsurprising, then, that one might take naturalistic epistemology to be radically empiricistic and committed to the non-existence of a priori knowledge.

Recent work in naturalistic epistemology has been far more sympathetic to the a priori than Quine's. Philip Kitcher has defended a naturalistic account of a priori knowledge that turns on the characteristics of the process that produces a belief. Roughly, he claims that one's knowledge that p is a priori if and only if it comes from the operation of a process that would have produced knowledge that p no matter what particular experiences one might have had. It is important to note here that we cannot simply reflect on the content of a proposition to determine whether it is knowable a priori in this sense. Rather, we have to take into account the actual facts about how our minds work and see whether there is any process that would produce knowledge of that proposition regardless of one's particular experiences. It is also doubtful that this sort of a priori knowledge could play the foundational role rationalists have typically assigned to the a priori.

Alvin Goldman has outlined a similar account of a priori knowledge. His account is based on two assumptions. First is his reliabilist account of epistemic justification. Second is the general idea that a priori knowledge is knowledge based on processes of "pure thought," which operate independently of experience or perception. If we are able to discover that human beings have reliable innate mechanisms of ratiocination and calculation - and there is some evidence that we do – then those mechanisms are reasonably counted as conferring a priori justification on beliefs. In particular, beliefs derived from the operations of those mechanisms, without any reliance on perception, are strong candidates for a priori knowledge.

c. The Problem of Induction

There is no standard naturalistic solution to the problem of induction, but naturalism does provide a general strategy for dealing with the problem. In broad strokes, the approach is to look at the ways in which people actually do perform inductive inferences and to evaluate those inductive methods along such dimensions as reliability.

One kind of inductive inference involves the projection of properties. For example, one might believe that robins and sparrows have Factor X in their blood, and one might then infer that cardinals also have Factor X in their blood. Hilary Kornblith advocates a naturalistic but metaphysical explanation for why such patterns of reasoning tend to be reliable. The causal structure of the world, in his view, leads to a "clustering" of properties in natural kinds. So, if bird is a natural kind, then there will be a number of properties birds have in common, and it is the causal structure of the world that "binds" those properties together. Furthermore, claims Kornblith, our best understanding of human inference points to the view that our minds are natively equipped with mechanisms tuned to the world's causal structure and to the clustering of properties in natural kinds. In short, we are hard wired to project properties typically in cases where the projections will work, owing to the world's causal structure.

Another kind of inductive inference, however, is probabilistic inference. For example, we might infer that the next card dealt from the deck probably will not be a heart, since only one card in four is a heart. A great deal of work has been done to study how people make probabilistic inferences, much of it initiated by Daniel Kahneman and Amos Tversky. The news here has not all been good. Our probabilistic inferences are often guided by heuristics and biases that lead us to wrong answers. This could be a case in which investigation of commonly used cognitive processes shows that they are not reliable or do not produce justified beliefs. However, some recent work on so-called "fast and frugal heuristics" aims to show that processes implementing inference patterns that are formally fallacious - that is, that violate the probability calculus – can be effective, fast, and reasonably reliable in the sorts of environments where those processes evolved.

3. Problems for Naturalistic Epistemology

Naturalistic epistemologies have it in common that they apply scientific methods, results, and theories to epistemological problems, though they differ in just which sciences they draw on and how central a place they give to those sciences. Despite this variation among naturalistic views, there are also some important objections to doing epistemology naturalistically at all. Two of those objections center on the Circularity Problem and the Problem of Normativity.

a. The Circularity Problem

Many philosophers suppose one of epistemology's most important tasks is to answer the Cartesian skeptic. Such a skeptic denies we could know most of the things we take ourselves to know, because we cannot rule out the logical possibility that we are massively deceived about the world. We might be victims of an evil demon, who is ultimately responsible for the nature of our experiences, or we might be brains in vats whose apparent experiences of an apparent external world come from a scientist armed with electrodes and chemicals.

Naturalistic epistemology seeks to explain knowledge by applying our best scientific understanding of the mind-brain. When the issue is skepticism, however, it might appear that using science would be viciously circular. Our scientific theories depend on our sensory experience, and so (says the skeptic or the anti-naturalist) we cannot legitimately appeal to those theories in explaining the possibility or actuality of perceptual knowledge (for example).

This line of objection to naturalistic epistemology is old, and Quine discusses it in "Epistemology Naturalized." In general, advocates of naturalism have had two things to say about it.

First, they point out (as did Hume) that we simply cannot step outside our going view of the world and evaluate it with no empirical presuppositions. So, the skeptic's demand for an external validation of science is misplaced. To understand what knowledge is and how it is possible, it is necessary to show how the phenomenon of knowledge fits into the rest of our understanding of things. The result will not be certainty that our scientific theories are correct, but we do not need that sort of certainty in order to get by.

Second, and perhaps more importantly, naturalistic epistemologists sometimes contend the circularity involved is not vicious because it does not beg the question. There is no guarantee our worldview will be self-supporting in the sense that our best scientific understanding of what knowledge is also shows that we do indeed have knowledge of the external world. It could turn out that, by their own lights, our scientific theories and our perceptual beliefs are not justified. Such a result would be disastrous, but naturalistic epistemology does not exclude it as a possibility. Even though we might not be able to validate our knowledge of the external world a priori, the fact that we can validate it at all is significant and non-trivial.

b. The Problem of Normativity

Another problem for naturalistic epistemology is explaining epistemic normativity. The ideas of knowledge and justified belief are normative in the sense that they include notions about what is right or wrong for a person to believe. Though science might be able to tell us about how people do come to believe as they do, critics of naturalistic epistemology often claim it cannot tell us about how people should come by their beliefs. This objection has been pressed by Jaegwon Kim, and it dates back at least to Wilfrid Sellars' Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind.

Advocates of naturalistic epistemology have typically countered by emphasizing the role of our cognitive goals in normative epistemic evaluations. For example, Goldman points to true belief as one of our most important cognitive goals, and Quine discusses the "anticipation of sensory stimulation" as providing a normative checkpoint for science. Naturalistic epistemology can be normative, on this view, because it can explain and detect the causal connections between our belief-forming processes and our cognitive goals. So, one might claim, epistemic justification is a "good" property of beliefs because justified beliefs come from reliable processes, and reliable processes are those whose use tends to promote the valuable goal of believing what is true and not what is false.

Epistemic value, on this approach, is a form of instrumental value; it derives from the causal ties between cognitive means and valuable cognitive ends. Some critics of naturalistic epistemology, notably Harvey Siegel, have argued that there must be some form of non-instrumental epistemic value. In light of their criticisms, advocates of naturalistic epistemology need either to show how a scientific approach can accommodate non-instrumental value or to explain why there is no need to do so.

4. Conclusion

Naturalistic epistemologists seek an understanding of knowledge that is scientifically informed and integrated with the rest of our understanding of the world. Their methods and commitments differ, because they have varying views about the precise relationship between science and epistemology and even about which sciences are most important to understanding knowledge.

In addressing particular issues, naturalists often make one of two general sorts of moves. The first is to try to show the issue is empirical and then to apply scientific data, results, methods, and theories to it directly. This is what happens when naturalists offer accounts of a priori knowledge based on cognitive psychology, and even when they offer naturalized conceptual analyses that they take to be based on empirical information concerning how concepts are applied.

A second common naturalistic move is to undermine a problem's motivation by showing it arises only on certain false, non-naturalistic assumptions. This is what happens when naturalists reject Cartesian skeptical problems, on the grounds those problems presuppose that our beliefs about the external world require external validation before they can be fully justified.

Despite its promise, naturalistic epistemology does face serious challenges from the problems of circularity and normativity. It is far from clear they are more serious than the challenges traditional, a priori epistemology faces, but naturalists certainly need solutions to the problems. Finding those solutions is one of the most important philosophical projects in this field that aims to unify science and philosophy.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bloor, D. 1981. The strengths of the strong programme. Philosophy of the social sciences, v. 11, pp. 199-213.
  • Davidson, D. 1984. A coherence theory of truth and knowledge. In his: Inquiries into truth and interpretation. Oxford, UK: Clarendon.
  • Gigerenzer, G., Todd, P., and the ABC Research Group. 1999. Simple heuristics that make us smart. New York: Oxford U P.
  • Goldman, A. 1967. A causal theory of knowing. Journal of philosophy, v. 64, pp. 357-372.
  • Goldman, A. 1976. Discrimination and perceptual knowledge. Journal of philosophy, v. 73, pp. 771-791.
  • Goldman, A. 1986. Epistemology and cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard U P.
  • Goldman, A. 1992. Liasons: Philosophy meets the cognitive and social sciences. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Goldman, A. 1999. a priori warrant and naturalistic epistemology. In: Tomberlin, J. E., ed., Philosophical Perspectives, v. 13. Cambridge, UK: Blackwell.
  • Goldman, A. 1999. Knowledge in a social world. Oxford, UK: Clarendon.
  • Kahneman, D., Slovic, P., and Tversky, A. Judgment under uncertainty: Heuristics and biases. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge U P.
  • Kim, J. 1988. What is "naturalized epistemology"? In: Tomberlin, J. E., ed. Philosophical Perspectives, v. 2. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview. pp. 381-405.
  • Kitcher, P. 1980. a priori knowledge. The philosophical review, v. 86. pp. 3-23.
  • Kitcher, P. 1992. The naturalists return. Philosophical Review, v. 101, n. 1. pp. 53-114.
  • Kitcher, P. 1993. The advancement of science. New York: Oxford U P.
  • Kornblith, H. 1993. Inductive inference and its natural ground. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Kornblith, H. ed. 1994. Naturalizing epistemology, 2d ed. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Kuhn, T. S. 1996. The structure of scientific revolutions, 3d ed. Chicago: U of Chicago Press.
  • Lakatos, I. 1971. Philosophical papers. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge U P.
  • Laudan, L. 1977. Progress and its problems. Berkeley: U of California Press.
  • Laudan, L. 1990. Normative naturalism. Philosophy of science, v. 57, n. 1, pp. 44-59.
  • Pollock, J. and Cruz, J. 1999. Contemporary theories of knowledge, 2d ed. Oxford: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Quine, W. V. 1960. Word and object. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Quine, W. V. 1969. Ontological relativity and other essays. New York: Columbia U P.
  • Quine, W. V. 1980. From a logical point of view. 2d ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard U P.
  • Quine, W. V. 1992. Pursuit of truth. Rev. ed. Cambridge, MA: Harvard U P.
  • Sellars, W. 1963. Science, perception, and reality. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Siegel, H.1990. Laudan's normative naturalism. Studies in history and philosophy of science, v. 21, n. 2, pp. 295-313.

Author Information

Chase B. Wrenn
University of Alabama
U. S. A.


Nihilism is the belief that all values are baseless and that nothing can be known or communicated. It is often associated with extreme pessimism and a radical skepticism that condemns existence. A true nihilist would believe in nothing, have no loyalties, and no purpose other than, perhaps, an impulse to destroy. While few philosophers would claim to be nihilists, nihilism is most often associated with Friedrich Nietzsche who argued that its corrosive effects would eventually destroy all moral, religious, and metaphysical convictions and precipitate the greatest crisis in human history. In the 20th century, nihilistic themes--epistemological failure, value destruction, and cosmic purposelessness--have preoccupied artists, social critics, and philosophers. Mid-century, for example, the existentialists helped popularize tenets of nihilism in their attempts to blunt its destructive potential. By the end of the century, existential despair as a response to nihilism gave way to an attitude of indifference, often associated with antifoundationalism.

Table of Contents

  1. Origins
  2. Friedrich Nietzsche and Nihilism
  3. Existential Nihilism
  4. Antifoundationalism and Nihilism
  5. Conclusion

1. Origins

"Nihilism" comes from the Latin nihil, or nothing, which means not anything, that which does not exist. It appears in the verb "annihilate," meaning to bring to nothing, to destroy completely. Early in the nineteenth century, Friedrich Jacobi used the word to negatively characterize transcendental idealism. It only became popularized, however, after its appearance in Ivan Turgenev's novel Fathers and Sons (1862) where he used "nihilism" to describe the crude scientism espoused by his character Bazarov who preaches a creed of total negation.

In Russia, nihilism became identified with a loosely organized revolutionary movement (C.1860-1917) that rejected the authority of the state, church, and family. In his early writing, anarchist leader Mikhael Bakunin (1814-1876) composed the notorious entreaty still identified with nihilism: "Let us put our trust in the eternal spirit which destroys and annihilates only because it is the unsearchable and eternally creative source of all life--the passion for destruction is also a creative passion!" (Reaction in Germany, 1842). The movement advocated a social arrangement based on rationalism and materialism as the sole source of knowledge and individual freedom as the highest goal. By rejecting man's spiritual essence in favor of a solely materialistic one, nihilists denounced God and religious authority as antithetical to freedom. The movement eventually deteriorated into an ethos of subversion, destruction, and anarchy, and by the late 1870s, a nihilist was anyone associated with clandestine political groups advocating terrorism and assassination.

The earliest philosophical positions associated with what could be characterized as a nihilistic outlook are those of the Skeptics. Because they denied the possibility of certainty, Skeptics could denounce traditional truths as unjustifiable opinions. When Demosthenes (c.371-322 BC), for example, observes that "What he wished to believe, that is what each man believes" (Olynthiac), he posits the relational nature of knowledge. Extreme skepticism, then, is linked to epistemological nihilism which denies the possibility of knowledge and truth; this form of nihilism is currently identified with postmodern antifoundationalism. Nihilism, in fact, can be understood in several different ways. Political Nihilism, as noted, is associated with the belief that the destruction of all existing political, social, and religious order is a prerequisite for any future improvement. Ethical nihilism or moral nihilism rejects the possibility of absolute moral or ethical values. Instead, good and evil are nebulous, and values addressing such are the product of nothing more than social and emotive pressures. Existential nihilism is the notion that life has no intrinsic meaning or value, and it is, no doubt, the most commonly used and understood sense of the word today.

Max Stirner's (1806-1856) attacks on systematic philosophy, his denial of absolutes, and his rejection of abstract concepts of any kind often places him among the first philosophical nihilists. For Stirner, achieving individual freedom is the only law; and the state, which necessarily imperils freedom, must be destroyed. Even beyond the oppression of the state, though, are the constraints imposed by others because their very existence is an obstacle compromising individual freedom. Thus Stirner argues that existence is an endless "war of each against all" (The Ego and its Own, trans. 1907).

2. Friedrich Nietzsche and Nihilism

Among philosophers, Friedrich Nietzsche is most often associated with nihilism. For Nietzsche, there is no objective order or structure in the world except what we give it. Penetrating the façades buttressing convictions, the nihilist discovers that all values are baseless and that reason is impotent. "Every belief, every considering something-true," Nietzsche writes, "is necessarily false because there is simply no true world" (Will to Power [notes from 1883-1888]). For him, nihilism requires a radical repudiation of all imposed values and meaning: "Nihilism is . . . not only the belief that everything deserves to perish; but one actually puts one's shoulder to the plough; one destroys" (Will to Power).

The caustic strength of nihilism is absolute, Nietzsche argues, and under its withering scrutiny "the highest values devalue themselves. The aim is lacking, and 'Why' finds no answer" (Will to Power). Inevitably, nihilism will expose all cherished beliefs and sacrosanct truths as symptoms of a defective Western mythos. This collapse of meaning, relevance, and purpose will be the most destructive force in history, constituting a total assault on reality and nothing less than the greatest crisis of humanity:

What I relate is the history of the next two centuries. I describe what is coming, what can no longer come differently: the advent of nihilism. . . . For some time now our whole European culture has been moving as toward a catastrophe, with a tortured tension that is growing from decade to decade: restlessly, violently, headlong, like a river that wants to reach the end. . . . (Will to Power)

Since Nietzsche's compelling critique, nihilistic themes--epistemological failure, value destruction, and cosmic purposelessness--have preoccupied artists, social critics, and philosophers. Convinced that Nietzsche's analysis was accurate, for example, Oswald Spengler in The Decline of the West (1926) studied several cultures to confirm that patterns of nihilism were indeed a conspicuous feature of collapsing civilizations. In each of the failed cultures he examines, Spengler noticed that centuries-old religious, artistic, and political traditions were weakened and finally toppled by the insidious workings of several distinct nihilistic postures: the Faustian nihilist "shatters the ideals"; the Apollinian nihilist "watches them crumble before his eyes"; and the Indian nihilist "withdraws from their presence into himself." Withdrawal, for instance, often identified with the negation of reality and resignation advocated by Eastern religions, is in the West associated with various versions of epicureanism and stoicism. In his study, Spengler concludes that Western civilization is already in the advanced stages of decay with all three forms of nihilism working to undermine epistemological authority and ontological grounding.

In 1927, Martin Heidegger, to cite another example, observed that nihilism in various and hidden forms was already "the normal state of man" (The Question of Being). Other philosophers' predictions about nihilism's impact have been dire. Outlining the symptoms of nihilism in the 20th century, Helmut Thielicke wrote that "Nihilism literally has only one truth to declare, namely, that ultimately Nothingness prevails and the world is meaningless" (Nihilism: Its Origin and Nature, with a Christian Answer, 1969). From the nihilist's perspective, one can conclude that life is completely amoral, a conclusion, Thielicke believes, that motivates such monstrosities as the Nazi reign of terror. Gloomy predictions of nihilism's impact are also charted in Eugene Rose's Nihilism: The Root of the Revolution of the Modern Age (1994). If nihilism proves victorious--and it's well on its way, he argues--our world will become "a cold, inhuman world" where "nothingness, incoherence, and absurdity" will triumph.

3. Existential Nihilism

While nihilism is often discussed in terms of extreme skepticism and relativism, for most of the 20th century it has been associated with the belief that life is meaningless. Existential nihilism begins with the notion that the world is without meaning or purpose. Given this circumstance, existence itself--all action, suffering, and feeling--is ultimately senseless and empty.

In The Dark Side: Thoughts on the Futility of Life (1994), Alan Pratt demonstrates that existential nihilism, in one form or another, has been a part of the Western intellectual tradition from the beginning. The Skeptic Empedocles' observation that "the life of mortals is so mean a thing as to be virtually un-life," for instance, embodies the same kind of extreme pessimism associated with existential nihilism. In antiquity, such profound pessimism may have reached its apex with Hegesis. Because miseries vastly outnumber pleasures, happiness is impossible, the philosopher argues, and subsequently advocates suicide. Centuries later during the Renaissance, William Shakespeare eloquently summarized the existential nihilist's perspective when, in this famous passage near the end of Macbeth, he has Macbeth pour out his disgust for life:

Out, out, brief candle!
Life's but a walking shadow, a poor player
That struts and frets his hour upon the stage
And then is heard no more; it is a tale
Told by an idiot, full of sound and fury,
Signifying nothing.

In the twentieth century, it's the atheistic existentialist movement, popularized in France in the 1940s and 50s, that is responsible for the currency of existential nihilism in the popular consciousness. Jean-Paul Sartre's (1905-1980) defining preposition for the movement, "existence precedes essence," rules out any ground or foundation for establishing an essential self or a human nature. When we abandon illusions, life is revealed as nothing; and for the existentialists, nothingness is the source of not only absolute freedom but also existential horror and emotional anguish. Nothingness reveals each individual as an isolated being "thrown" into an alien and unresponsive universe, barred forever from knowing why yet required to invent meaning. It's a situation that's nothing short of absurd. Writing from the enlightened perspective of the absurd, Albert Camus (1913-1960) observed that Sisyphus' plight, condemned to eternal, useless struggle, was a superb metaphor for human existence (The Myth of Sisyphus, 1942).

The common thread in the literature of the existentialists is coping with the emotional anguish arising from our confrontation with nothingness, and they expended great energy responding to the question of whether surviving it was possible. Their answer was a qualified "Yes," advocating a formula of passionate commitment and impassive stoicism. In retrospect, it was an anecdote tinged with desperation because in an absurd world there are absolutely no guidelines, and any course of action is problematic. Passionate commitment, be it to conquest, creation, or whatever, is itself meaningless. Enter nihilism.

Camus, like the other existentialists, was convinced that nihilism was the most vexing problem of the twentieth century. Although he argues passionately that individuals could endure its corrosive effects, his most famous works betray the extraordinary difficulty he faced building a convincing case. In The Stranger (1942), for example, Meursault has rejected the existential suppositions on which the uninitiated and weak rely. Just moments before his execution for a gratuitous murder, he discovers that life alone is reason enough for living, a raison d'être, however, that in context seems scarcely convincing. In Caligula (1944), the mad emperor tries to escape the human predicament by dehumanizing himself with acts of senseless violence, fails, and surreptitiously arranges his own assassination. The Plague (1947) shows the futility of doing one's best in an absurd world. And in his last novel, the short and sardonic, The Fall (1956), Camus posits that everyone has bloody hands because we are all responsible for making a sorry state worse by our inane action and inaction alike. In these works and other works by the existentialists, one is often left with the impression that living authentically with the meaninglessness of life is impossible.

Camus was fully aware of the pitfalls of defining existence without meaning, and in his philosophical essay The Rebel (1951) he faces the problem of nihilism head-on. In it, he describes at length how metaphysical collapse often ends in total negation and the victory of nihilism, characterized by profound hatred, pathological destruction, and incalculable violence and death.

4. Antifoundationalism and Nihilism

By the late 20th century, "nihilism" had assumed two different castes. In one form, "nihilist" is used to characterize the postmodern person, a dehumanized conformist, alienated, indifferent, and baffled, directing psychological energy into hedonistic narcissism or into a deep ressentiment that often explodes in violence. This perspective is derived from the existentialists' reflections on nihilism stripped of any hopeful expectations, leaving only the experience of sickness, decay, and disintegration.

In his study of meaninglessness, Donald Crosby writes that the source of modern nihilism paradoxically stems from a commitment to honest intellectual openness. "Once set in motion, the process of questioning could come to but one end, the erosion of conviction and certitude and collapse into despair" (The Specter of the Absurd, 1988). When sincere inquiry is extended to moral convictions and social consensus, it can prove deadly, Crosby continues, promoting forces that ultimately destroy civilizations. Michael Novak's recently revised The Experience of Nothingness (1968, 1998) tells a similar story. Both studies are responses to the existentialists' gloomy findings from earlier in the century. And both optimistically discuss ways out of the abyss by focusing of the positive implications nothingness reveals, such as liberty, freedom, and creative possibilities. Novak, for example, describes how since WWII we have been working to "climb out of nihilism" on the way to building a new civilization.

In contrast to the efforts to overcome nihilism noted above is the uniquely postmodern response associated with the current antifoundationalists. The philosophical, ethical, and intellectual crisis of nihilism that has tormented modern philosophers for over a century has given way to mild annoyance or, more interestingly, an upbeat acceptance of meaninglessness.

French philosopher Jean-Francois Lyotard characterizes postmodernism as an "incredulity toward metanarratives," those all-embracing foundations that we have relied on to make sense of the world. This extreme skepticism has undermined intellectual and moral hierarchies and made "truth" claims, transcendental or transcultural, problematic. Postmodern antifoundationalists, paradoxically grounded in relativism, dismiss knowledge as relational and "truth" as transitory, genuine only until something more palatable replaces it (reminiscent of William James' notion of "cash value"). The critic Jacques Derrida, for example, asserts that one can never be sure that what one knows corresponds with what is. Since human beings participate in only an infinitesimal part of the whole, they are unable to grasp anything with certainty, and absolutes are merely "fictional forms."

American antifoundationalist Richard Rorty makes a similar point: "Nothing grounds our practices, nothing legitimizes them, nothing shows them to be in touch with the way things are" ("From Logic to Language to Play," 1986). This epistemological cul-de-sac, Rorty concludes, leads inevitably to nihilism. "Faced with the nonhuman, the nonlinguistic, we no longer have the ability to overcome contingency and pain by appropriation and transformation, but only the ability to recognize contingency and pain" (Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity, 1989). In contrast to Nietzsche's fears and the angst of the existentialists, nihilism becomes for the antifoundationalists just another aspect of our contemporary milieu, one best endured with sang-froid.

In The Banalization of Nihilism (1992) Karen Carr discusses the antifoundationalist response to nihilism. Although it still inflames a paralyzing relativism and subverts critical tools, "cheerful nihilism" carries the day, she notes, distinguished by an easy-going acceptance of meaninglessness. Such a development, Carr concludes, is alarming. If we accept that all perspectives are equally non-binding, then intellectual or moral arrogance will determine which perspective has precedence. Worse still, the banalization of nihilism creates an environment where ideas can be imposed forcibly with little resistance, raw power alone determining intellectual and moral hierarchies. It's a conclusion that dovetails nicely with Nietzsche's, who pointed out that all interpretations of the world are simply manifestations of will-to-power.

5. Conclusion

It has been over a century now since Nietzsche explored nihilism and its implications for civilization. As he predicted, nihilism's impact on the culture and values of the 20th century has been pervasive, its apocalyptic tenor spawning a mood of gloom and a good deal of anxiety, anger, and terror. Interestingly, Nietzsche himself, a radical skeptic preoccupied with language, knowledge, and truth, anticipated many of the themes of postmodernity. It's helpful to note, then, that he believed we could--at a terrible price--eventually work through nihilism. If we survived the process of destroying all interpretations of the world, we could then perhaps discover the correct course for humankind:

I praise, I do not reproach, [nihilism's] arrival. I believe it is one of the greatest crises, a moment of the deepest self-reflection of humanity. Whether man recovers from it, whether he becomes master of this crisis, is a question of his strength. It is possible. . . . (Complete Works Vol. 13)

Author Information

Alan Pratt
Embry-Riddle University
U. S. A.


Neo-platonism (or Neoplatonism) is a modern term used to designate the period of Platonic philosophy beginning with the work of Plotinus and ending with the closing of the Platonic Academy by the Emperor Justinian in 529 C.E. This brand of Platonism, which is often described as 'mystical' or religious in nature, developed outside the mainstream of Academic Platonism. The origins of Neoplatonism can be traced back to the era of Hellenistic syncretism which spawned such movements and schools of thought as Gnosticism and the Hermetic tradition. A major factor in this syncretism, and one which had an immense influence on the development of Platonic thought, was the introduction of the Jewish Scriptures into Greek intellectual circles via the translation known as the Septuagint. The encounter between the creation narrative of Genesis and the cosmology of Plato's Timaeus set in motion a long tradition of cosmological theorizing that finally culminated in the grand schema of Plotinus' Enneads. Plotinus' two major successors, Porphyry and Iamblichus, each developed, in their own way, certain isolated aspects of Plotinus' thought, but neither of them developed a rigorous philosophy to match that of their master. It was Proclus who, shortly before the closing of the Academy, bequeathed a systematic Platonic philosophy upon the world that in certain ways approached the sophistication of Plotinus. Finally, in the work of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius, we find a grand synthesis of Platonic philosophy and Christian theology that was to exercise an immense influence on mediaeval mysticism and Renaissance Humanism.

Table of Contents

  1. What is Neoplatonism?
  2. Plotinian Neoplatonism
    1. Contemplation and Creation
    2. Nature and Personality
    3. Salvation and the Cosmic Process
      1. Plotinus' Last Words
    4. The Achievement of Plotinus
      1. The Plotinian Synthesis
  3. Porphyry and Iamblichus
    1. The Nature of the Soul
      1. The (re)turn to Astrology
    2. The Quest for Transcendence
      1. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic
  4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius
    1. Being -- Becoming -- Being
    2. The God Beyond Being
  5. Appendix: The Renaissance Platonists
  6. References and Further Reading

1. What is Neoplatonism?

The term 'Neoplatonism' is a modern construction. Plotinus, who is often considered the 'founder' of Neoplatonism, would not have considered himself a "new" Platonist in any sense, but simply an expositor of the doctrines of Plato. That this required him to formulate an entirely new philosophical system would not have been viewed by him as a problem, for it was, in his eyes, precisely what the Platonic doctrine required. In a sense, this is true, for as early as the Old Academy we find Plato's successors struggling with the proper interpretation of his thought, and arriving at strikingly different conclusions. Also, in the Hellenistic era, certain Platonic ideas were taken up by thinkers of various loyalties -- Jewish, Gnostic, Christian -- and worked up into new forms of expression that varied quite considerably from what Plato actually wrote in his Dialogues. Should this lead us to the conclusion that these thinkers were any less 'loyal' to Plato than were the members of the Academy (in its various forms throughout the centuries preceding Plotinus)? No; for the multiple and often contradictory uses made of Platonic ideas is a testament to the universality of Plato's thought -- that is, its ability to admit of a wide variety of interpretations and applications. In this sense, Neo-Platonism may be said to have begun immediately after Plato's death, when new approaches to his philosophy were being broached. Indeed, we already see a hint, in the doctrines of Xenocrates (the second head of the Old Academy) of a type of salvation theory involving the unification of the two parts of the human soul -- the "Olympian" or heavenly, and the "Titanic" or earthly (Dillon 1977, p. 27). If we accept Frederick Copleston's description of Neoplatonism as "the intellectualist reply to the ... yearning for personal salvation" (Copleston 1962, p. 216) we can already locate the beginning of this reply as far back as the Old Academy, and Neoplatonism would then not have begun with Plotinus. However, it is not clear that Xenocrates' idea of salvation involved the individual; it is quite possible that he was referring to a unified human nature in an abstract sense. In any case, the early Hermetic-Gnostic tradition is certainly to an extent Platonic, and later Gnosticism and Christian Logos theology markedly so. If an intellectual reply to a general yearning for personal salvation is what characterizes Neoplatonism, then the highly intellectual Gnostics and Christians of the Late Hellenistic era must be given the title of Neoplatonists. However, if we are to be rigorous and define Neoplatonism as the synthesis of various more or less 'Platonistic' ideas into a grand expression of Platonic philosophy, then Plotinus must be considered the founder of Neoplatonism. Yet we must not forget that these Platonizing Christian, Gnostic, Jewish, and other 'pagan' thinkers provided the necessary speculative material to make this synthesis possible.

2. Plotinian Neoplatonism

The great third century thinker and 'founder' of Neoplatonism, Plotinus, is responsible for the grand synthesis of progressive Christian and Gnostic ideas with the traditional Platonic philosophy. He answered the challenge of accounting for the emergence of a seemingly inferior and flawed cosmos from the perfect mind of the divinity by declaring outright that all objective existence is but the external self-expression of an inherently contemplative deity known as the One (to hen), or the Good (ta kalon). Plotinus compares the expression of the superior godhead with the self-expression of the individual soul, which proceeds from the perfect conception of a Form (eidos), to the always flawed expression of this Form in the manner of a materially derived 'personality' that risks succumbing to the demands of divisive discursivity, and so becomes something less than divine. This diminution of the divine essence in temporality is but a necessary moment of the complete expression of the One. By elevating the experience of the individual soul to the status of an actualization of a divine Form, Plotinus succeeded, also, in preserving, if not the autonomy, at least the dignity and ontological necessity of personality. The Cosmos, according to Plotinus, is not a created order, planned by a deity on whom we can pass the charge of begetting evil; for the Cosmos is the self-expression of the Soul, which corresponds, roughly, to Philo's logos prophorikos, the logos endiathetos of which is the Intelligence (nous). Rather, the Cosmos, in Plotinian terms, is to be understood as the concrete result or 'product' of the Soul's experience of its own Mind (nous). Ideally, this concrete expression should serve the Soul as a reference-point for its own self-conscious existence; however, the Soul all too easily falls into the error of valuing the expression over the principle (arkhê), which is the contemplation of the divine Forms. This error gives rise to evil, which is the purely subjective relation of the Soul (now divided) to the manifold and concrete forms of its expressive act. When the Soul, in the form of individual existents, becomes thus preoccupied with its experience, Nature comes into being, and the Cosmos takes on concrete form as the locus of personality.

a. Contemplation and Creation

Hearkening back, whether consciously or not, to the doctrine of Speusippus (Plato's successor in the Academy) that the One is utterly transcendent and "beyond being," and that the Dyad is the true first principle (Dillon 1977, p. 12), Plotinus declares that the One is "alone with itself" and ineffable (cf. Enneads VI.9.6 and V.2.1). The One does not act to produce a cosmos or a spiritual order, but simply generates from itself, effortlessly, a power (dunamis) which is at once the Intellect (nous) and the object of contemplation (theôria) of this Intellect. While Plotinus suggests that the One subsists by thinking itself as itself, the Intellect subsists through thinking itself as other, and therefore becomes divided within itself: this act of division within the Intellect is the production of Being, which is the very principle of expression or discursivity (Ennead V.1.7). For this reason, the Intellect stands as Plotinus' sole First Principle. At this point, the thinking or contemplation of the Intellect is divided up and ordered into thoughts, each of them subsisting in and for themselves, as autonomous reflections of the dunamis of the One. These are the Forms (eidê), and out of their inert unity there arises the Soul, whose task it is to think these Forms discursively and creatively, and to thereby produce or create a concrete, living expression of the divine Intellect. This activity of the Soul results in the production of numerous individual souls: living actualizations of the possibilities inherent in the Forms. Whereas the Intellect became divided within itself through contemplation, the Soul becomes divided outside of itself, through action (which is still contemplation, according to Plotinus, albeit the lowest type; cf. Ennead III.8.4), and this division constitutes the Cosmos, which is the expressive or creative act of the Soul, also referred to as Nature. When the individual soul reflects upon Nature as its own act, this soul is capable of attaining insight (gnôsis) into the essence of Intellect; however, when the soul views nature as something objective and external -- that is, as something to be experienced or undergone, while forgetting that the soul itself is the creator of this Nature -- evil and suffering ensue. Let us now examine the manner in which Plotinus explains Nature as the locus of personality.

b. Nature and Personality

Contemplation, at the level of the Soul, is for Plotinus a two-way street. The Soul both contemplates, passively, the Intellect, and reflects upon its own contemplative act by producing Nature and the Cosmos. The individual souls that become immersed in Nature, as moments of the Soul's eternal act, will, ideally, gain a complete knowledge of the Soul in its unity, and even of the Intellect, by reflecting upon the concrete results of the Soul's act -- that is, upon the externalized, sensible entities that comprise the physical Cosmos. This reflection, if carried by the individual soul with a memory of its provenance always in the foreground, will lead to a just governing of the physical Cosmos, which will make of it a perfect material image of the Intellectual Cosmos, i.e., the realm of the Forms (cf. Enneads IV.3.7 and IV.8.6). However, things don't always turn out so well, for individual souls often "go lower than is needful ... in order to light the lower regions, but it is not good for them to go so far" (Ennead IV.3.17, tr. O'Brien 1964). For when the soul extends itself ever farther into the indeterminacy of materiality, it gradually loses memory of its divine origin, and comes to identify itself more and more with its surroundings -- that is to say: the soul identifies itself with the results of the Soul's act, and forgets that it is, as part of this Soul, itself an agent of the act. This is tantamount to a relinquishing, by the soul, of its divine nature. When the soul has thus abandoned itself, it begins to accrue many alien encrustations, if you will, that make of it something less than divine. These encrustations are the 'accidents' (in the Aristotelian sense) of personality. And yet the soul is never completely lost, for, as Plotinus insists, the soul need simply "think upon essential being" in order to return to itself, and continue to exist authentically as a governor of the Cosmos (Ennead IV.8.4-6). The memory of the personality that this wandering soul possessed must be forgotten in order for it to return completely to its divine nature; for if it were remembered, we would have to say, contradictorily, that the soul holds a memory of what occurred during its state of forgetfulness! So in a sense, Plotinus holds that individual personalities are not maintained at the level of Soul. However, if we understand personality as more than just a particular attitude attached to a concrete mode of existence, and rather view it as the sum total of experiences reflected upon in intellect, then souls most certainly retain their personalities, even at the highest level, for they persist as thoughts within the divine Mind (cp. Ennead IV.8.5). The personality that one acquires in action (the lowest type of contemplation) is indeed forgotten and dissolved, but the 'personality' or persistence in intellect that one achieves through virtuous acts most definitely endures (Ennead IV.3.32).

c. Salvation and the Cosmic Process

Plotinus, like his older contemporary, the Christian philosopher Origen of Alexandria, views the descent of the soul into the material realm as a necessary moment in the unfolding of the divine Intellect, or God. For this reason, the descent itself is not an evil, for it is a reflection of God's essence. Both Origen and Plotinus place the blame for experiencing this descent as an evil squarely upon the individual soul. Of course, these thinkers held, respectively, quite different views as to why and how the soul experiences the descent as an evil; but they held one thing in common: that the rational soul will naturally choose the Good, and that any failure to do so is the result of forgetfulness or acquired ignorance. But whence this failure? Origen gave what, to Plotinus' mind, must have been a quite unsatisfactory answer: that souls pre-existed as spiritual beings, and when they desired to create or 'beget' independently of God, they all fell into error, and languished there until the coming of Logos Incarnate. This view has more than a little Gnostic flavor to it, which would have sat ill with Plotinus, who was a great opponent of Gnosticism. The fall of the soul Plotinus refers, quite simply, to the tension between pure contemplation and divisive action -- a tension that constitutes the natural mode of existence of the soul (cf. Ennead IV.8.6-7). Plotinus tells us that a thought is only completed or fully comprehended after it has been expressed, for only then can the thought be said to have passed from potentiality to actuality (Ennead IV.3.30). The question of whether Plotinus places more value on the potential or the actual is really of no consequence, for in the Plotinian plêrôma every potentiality generates an activity, and every activity becomes itself a potential for new activity (cf. Ennead III.8.8); and since the One, which is the goal or object of desire of all existents, is neither potentiality nor actuality, but "beyond being" (epekeina ousias), it is impossible to say whether the striving of existents, in Plotinus' schema, will result in full and complete actualization, or in a repose of potentiality that will make them like their source. "Likeness to God as far as possible," for Plotinus, is really likeness to oneself -- authentic existence. Plotinus leaves it up to the individual to determine what this means.

i. Plotinus' Last Words

In his biography of Plotinus, Porphyry records the last words of his teacher to his students as follows: "Strive to bring back the god in yourselves to the God in the All" (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 2, my translation). After uttering these words, Plotinus, one of the greatest philosophers the world has ever known, passed away. The simplicity of this final statement seems to be at odds with the intellectual rigors of Plotinus' treatises, which challenge -- and more often than not vanquish -- just about every prominent philosophical view of the era. But this is only if we take this remark in a mystical or ecstatic religious sense. Plotinus demanded the utmost level of intellectual clarity in dealing with the problem of humankind's relation to the highest principle of existence. Striving for or desiring salvation was not, for Plotinus, an excuse for simply abandoning oneself to faith or prayer or unreflective religious rituals; rather, salvation was to be achieved through the practice of philosophical investigation, of dialectic. The fact that Plotinus, at the end of his life, had arrived at this very simple formulation, serves to show that his dialectical quest was successful. In his last treatise, "On the Primal Good" (Ennead I.7), Plotinus is able to assert, in the same breath, that both life and death are good. He says this because life is the moment in which the soul expresses itself and revels in the autonomy of the creative act. However, this life, since it is characterized by action, eventually leads to exhaustion, and the desire, not for autonomous action, but for reposeful contemplation -- of a fulfillment that is purely intellectual and eternal. Death is the relief of this exhaustion, and the return to a state of contemplative repose. Is this return to the Intellect a return to potentiality? It is hard to say. Perhaps it is a synthesis of potentiality and actuality: the moment at which the soul is both one and many, both human and divine. This would constitute Plotinian salvation -- the fulfillment of the exhortation of the dying sage.

d. The Achievement of Plotinus

In the last analysis, what stands as the most important and impressive accomplishment of Plotinus is the manner in which he synthesized the pure, 'semi-mythical' expression of Plato with the logical rigors of the Peripatetic and Stoic schools, yet without losing sight of philosophy's most important task: of rendering the human experience in intelligible and analyzable terms. That Plotinus' thought had to take the 'detour' through such wildly mystical and speculative paths as Gnosticism and Christian salvation theology is only proof of his clear-sightedness, thoroughness, and admirable humanism. For all of his dialectical difficulties and perambulations, Plotinus' sole concern is with the well-being (eudaimonia) of the human soul. This is, of course, to be understood as an intellectual, as opposed to a merely physical or even emotional well-being, for Plotinus was not concerned with the temporary or the temporal. The striving of the human mind for a mode of existence more suited to its intuited potential than the ephemeral possibilities of this material realm, while admittedly a striving born of temporality, is nonetheless directed toward atemporal and divine perfection. This is a striving or desire rendered all the more poignant and worthy of philosophy precisely because it is born in the depths of existential angst, and not in the primitive ecstasies of unreflective ritual. As the last true representative of the Greek philosophical spirit, Plotinus is Apollonian, not Dionysian. His concern is with the intellectual beautification of the human soul, and for this reason his notion of salvation does not, like Origen's, imply an eternal state of objective contemplation of the divinity -- for Plotinus, the separation between human and god breaks down, so that when the perfected soul contemplates itself, it is also contemplating the Supreme.

i. The Plotinian Synthesis

Plotinus was faced with the task of defending the true Platonic philosophy, as he understood it, against the inroads being made, in his time, most of all by Gnostics, but also by orthodox Christianity. Instead of launching an all-out attack on these new ideas, Plotinus took what was best from them, in his eyes, and brought these ideas into concert with his own brand of Platonism. For this reason, we are sometimes surprised to see Plotinus, in one treatise, speaking of the cosmos as a realm of forgetfulness and error, while in another, speaking of the cosmos as the most perfect expression of the godhead. Once we realize the extent to which certain Gnostic sects went in order to brand this world as a product of an evil and malignant Demiurge, to whom we owe absolutely no allegiance, it becomes clear that Plotinus was simply trying to temper the extreme form of an idea which he himself shared, though in a less radical sense. The feeling of being thrown into a hostile and alien world is a philosophically valid position from which to begin a critique and investigation of human existence; indeed, modern existentialist philosophers have often started from this same premise. However, Plotinus realized that it is not the nature of the human soul to simply escape from a realm of active engagement with external reality (the cosmos) to a passive receptance of divine form (within the plêrôma). The Soul, as Plotinus understands it, is an essentially creative being, and one which understands existence on its own terms. One of the beauties of Plotinus' system is that everything he says concerning the nature of the Cosmos (spiritual and physical) can equally be held of the Soul. Now while it would be false to charge Plotinus with solipsism (or even narcissism, as one prominent commentator has done; cf. Julia Kristeva in Hadot 1993, p. 11), it would be correct to say that the entire Cosmos is an analogue of the experience of the Soul, which results in the attainment of full self-consciousness. The form of Plotinus' system is the very form by which the Soul naturally comes to know itself in relation to its acts; and the expression of the Soul will always, therefore, be a philosophical expression. When we speak of the Plotinian synthesis, then, what we are speaking of is a natural dialectic of the Soul, which takes its own expressions into account, no matter how faulty or incomplete they may appear in retrospect, and weaves them into a cosmic tapestry of noetic images.

3. Porphyry and Iamblichus

Porphyry of Tyre (ca. 233-305 CE) is the most famous pupil of Plotinus. In addition to writing an introductory summary of his master's theories (the treatise entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind), Porphyry also composed the famous Isagoge, an introduction to the Categories of Aristotle, which came to exercise an immense influence on Mediaeval Scholasticism. The extent of Porphyry's investigative interests exceeded that of his teacher, and his so-called "scientific" works, which survive to this day, include a treatise on music (On Prosody), and two studies of the astronomical and astrological theories of Claudius Ptolemy (ca. 70-140 CE), On the Harmonics, and an Introduction to The Astronomy of Ptolemy. He wrote biographies of Pythagoras and Plotinus, and edited and compiled the latter's essays into six books, each containing nine treatises, giving them the title Enneads. Unlike Plotinus, Porphyry was interested primarily in the practical aspect of salvific striving, and the manner in which the soul could most effectively bring about its transference to ever higher realms of existence. This led Porphyry to develop a doctrine of ascent to the Intellect by way of the exercise of virtue (aretê) in the form of 'good works'. This doctrine may owe its genesis to Porphyry's supposed early adherence to Christianity, as attested by the historian Socrates, and suggested by St. Augustine (cf. Copleston 1962, p. 218). If Porphyry had, at some point, been a Christian, this would account for his belief in the soul's objective relation to the divine Mind -- an idea shared by Origen, whom Porphyry knew as a youth (cf. Eusebius, The History of the Church, p. 195) -- and would explain his quite un-Plotinian belief in a gradual progress toward perfection, as opposed to the 'instant salvation' proposed by Plotinus (cf. Ennead IV.8.4).

Iamblichus of Apamea (d. ca. 330 CE) was a student of Porphyry. He departed from his teacher on more than a few points, most notably in his insistence on demoting Plotinus' One (which Porphyry left unscathed, as it were) to the level of kosmos noêtos, which according to Iamblichus generates the intellectual realm (kosmos noêros). In this regard, Iamblichus can be said to have either severely misunderstood, or neglected to even attempt to understand, Plotinus on the important doctrine of contemplation (see above). This view led Iamblichus to posit a Supreme One even higher than the One of Plotinus, which generates the Intellectual Cosmos, and yet remains beyond all predication and determinacy. Iamblichus also made a tripartite division of Soul, positing a cosmic or All-Soul, and two lesser souls, corresponding to the rational and irrational faculties, respectively. This somewhat gratuitous skewing of the Plotinian noetic realm also led Iamblichus to posit an array of intermediate spiritual beings between the lower souls and the intelligible realm -- daemons, the souls of heroes, and angels of all sorts. By placing so much distance between the earthly soul and the intelligible realm, Iamblichus made it difficult for the would-be philosopher to gain an intuitive knowledge of the higher Soul, although he insisted that everyone possesses such knowledge, coupled with an innate desire for the Good. In place of the vivid dialectic of Plotinus, Iamblichus established the practice of theurgy (theourgia), which he insists does not draw the gods down to man, but rather renders humankind, "who through generation are born subject to passion, pure and unchangeable" (On the Mysteries I.12.42; in Fowden 1986, p. 133). Whereas "likeness to God" had meant, for Plotinus, a recollection and perfection of one's own divine nature (which is, in the last analysis, identical to nous; cf. Ennead III.4), for Iamblichus the relation of humankind to the divine is one of subordinate to superior, and so the pagan religious piety that Plotinus had scorned -- "Let the gods come to me, and not I to them," he had once said (cf. Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 10) -- returns to philosophy with a vengeance. Iamblichus is best known for his lengthy treatise On the Mysteries. Like Porphyry, he also wrote a biography of Pythagoras.

a. The Nature of the Soul

In his introduction to the philosophy of Plotinus, entitled Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind, Porphyry remarks that the inclination of the incorporeal Soul toward corporeality "constitutes a second nature [the irrational soul], which unites with the body" (Launching-Points 18 [1]). This remark is supposedly a commentary on Ennead IV.2, where Plotinus discusses the relation of the individual soul to the All-Soul. While it is true that Plotinus often speaks of the individual soul as being independent of the highest Soul, he does this for illustrative purposes, in order to show how far into forgetfulness the soul that has become enamored of its act may fall. Yet Plotinus insists time and again that the individual soul and the All-Soul are one (cf. esp. Ennead IV.1), and that Nature is the Soul's expressive act (see above). Irrationality does not constitute, for Plotinus, a "second nature," but is merely a flawed exercise of rationality -- that is, doxa untempered by epistêmê -- on the part of the individual soul. Furthermore, the individual soul, which comes to unite with corporeality, governs and controls the body, making possible discursive knowledge as well as sense-perception. Uncontrolled pathos is what Plotinus calls irrationality; the soul brings aisthêsis (perceptive judgment) to corporeality, and so prevents it from sinking into irrational passivity. So what led Porphyry to make such an interpretative error, if error it was? It is quite possible that Porphyry had arrived at his own conclusions about the Soul, and tried to square his own theory with what Plotinus actually taught. One clue to the reason for the 'misunderstanding' may possibly lie in Porphyry's early involvement with Christianity. While Porphyry himself never tells us that he had been a Christian, Augustine speaks of him as if he were an apostate, and the historian Socrates states outright that Porphyry had once been of the Christian faith, telling us that he left the fold in disgust after being assaulted by a rowdy band of Christians in Caesarea (Copleston 1962, p. 218). In any case, it is certain that he was acquainted with Plotinus' older contemporary, the Christian Origen, and that he had been exposed to Christian doctrine. Indeed, his own spirited attack on Christianity ("Fifteen Arguments Against the Christians," now preserved only in fragments) shows him to have possessed a wide knowledge of Holy Scripture, remarkable for a 'pagan' philosopher of that era. Porphyry's exposure to Christian doctrine, then, would have left him with a view of salvation quite different from that of Plotinus, who seems never to have paid Christianity much mind. The best evidence we have for this explanation is Porphyry's own theory of salvation -- and it is remarkably similar to what we find in Origen! Porphyry's salvation theory is dependent, like Origen's, on a notion of the soul's objective relation to God, and its consequent striving, not to actualize its own divine potentiality, but to attain a level of virtue that makes it capable of partaking fully of the divine essence. This is accomplished through the exercise of virtue, which sets the soul on a gradual course of progress toward the highest Good. Beginning with simple 'practical virtues' (politikai arêtai) the soul gradually rises to higher levels, eventually attaining what Porphyry calls the paradeigmatikai arêtai or 'exemplary virtues' which make of the soul a living expression of the divine Mind (cf. Porphyry, Letter to Marcella 29). Note that Porphyry stops the soul's ascent at nous, and presumably holds that the 'saved' soul will eternally contemplate the infinite power of the One. If Porphyry's concern had been with the preservation of personality, then this explanation makes some sense. However, it is more likely that the true reason for Porphyry's rejection of the radically 'hubristic' theory (at least to pietistic pagans) of the nature of the individual soul held by Plotinus was a result of his intention to restore dignity to the traditional religion of the Greeks (which had come under attack not only by Plotinus, but by Christians as well). Evidence of such a program resides in Porphyry's allegorical interpretations of Homer and traditional cultic practice, as well as his possibly apologetic work on Philosophy from Oracles (now lost). Compared to Plotinus, then, Porphyry was quite the conservative, concerned as he was with maintaining the ancient view of humankind's relatively humble position in the cosmic hierarchy, over against Plotinus' view that the soul is a god, owing little more than a passing nod to its 'noble brethren' in the heavens.

i. The (re)turn to Astrology

One of the results of Porphyry's conservative position toward traditional religious practice and belief was the 'return' to the doctrine that the stars and planets are capable of affecting and ordering human life. Plotinus argued that since the individual soul is one with the All-Soul, it is in essence a co-creator of the Cosmos, and therefore not really subject to the laws governing the Cosmos -- for the soul is the source and agent of those laws! Therefore, a belief in astrology was, for Plotinus, absurd, since if the soul turned to beings dependent upon its own law -- i.e., the stars and planets -- in order to know itself, then it would only end up knowing aspects of its own act, and would never return to itself in full self-consciousness. Furthermore, as we have seen, Plotinian salvation was instantly available to the soul, if only it would turn its mind to "essential being" (see above); because of this, Plotinus saw no reason to bring the stars and planets into the picture. For Porphyry, however, who believed that the soul must gradually work toward salvation, a knowledge of the operations of the heavenly bodies and their relation to humankind would have been an important tool in gaining ever higher levels of virtue. In fact, Porphyry seems to have held the view that the soul receives certain "powers" from each of the planets -- right judgment from Saturn, proper exercise of the will from Jupiter, impulse from Mars, opinion and imagination from the Sun, and (what else?) sensuous desire from Venus; from the Moon the soul receives the power of physical production (cf. Hegel, p. 430) -- and that these powers enable to the soul to know things both earthly and heavenly. This theoretical knowledge of the powers of the planets, then, would have made the more practical knowledge of astrology quite useful and meaningful for an individual soul seeking to know itself as such. The usefulness of astrology for Porphyry, in this regard, probably resided in its ability to permit an individual, through an analysis of his birth chart, to know which planet -- and therefore which "power" -- exercised the dominant influence on his life. In keeping with the ancient Greek doctrine of the "golden mean," the task of the individual would then be to work to bring to the fore those other "powers" -- each present to a lesser degree in the soul, but still active -- and thereby achieve a balance or sôphrosunê that would render the soul more capable of sharing in the divine Mind. The art of astrology, it must be remembered, was in wide practice in the Hellenistic world, and Plotinus' rejection of it was an exception that was by no means the rule. Plotinus' views on astrology apparently found few adherents, even among Platonists, for we see not only Porphyry, but also (to an extent) Iamblichus and even Proclus declaring its value -- the latter being responsible for a paraphrase of Claudius Ptolemy's astrological compendium known as the Tetrabiblos or sometimes simply as The Astronomy. In addition to penning a commentary on Ptolemy's tome, Porphyry also wrote his own Introduction to Astronomy (by which is apparently meant "Astrology," the modern distinction not holding in Hellenistic times). Unfortunately, this work no longer survives intact.

(For more on this topic, see Hellenistic Astrology.)

b. The Quest for Transcendence

The philosophy of Plotinus was highly discursive, meaning that it operated on the assumption that the highest meaning, the most profound truth (even a so-called mystical truth) is translatable, necessarily, into language; and furthermore, that any and every experience only attains its full value as meaning when it has reached expression in the form of language. This idea, of course, placed the One always beyond the discursive understanding of the human soul, since the One was proclaimed, by Plotinus, to be not only beyond discursive knowledge, but also the very source and possibility of such knowledge. According to Plotinus, then, any time the individual soul expresses a certain truth in language, this very act is representative of the power of the One. This notion of the simultaneous intimate proximity of the One to the soul, and, paradoxically, its extreme transcendence and ineffability, is possible only within the confines of a purely subjective and introspective philosophy like that of Plotinus; and since such a philosophy, by its very nature, cannot appeal to common, external perceptions, it is destined to remain the sole provenance of the sensitive and enlightened few. Porphyry did not want to admit this, and so he found himself seeking, as St. Augustine tells us, "a universal way (universalem viam) for the liberation of the soul" (City of God 10.32, in Fowden, p. 132), believing, as he did, that no such way had yet been discovered by or within philosophy. This did not imply, for Porphyry, a wholesale rejection of the Plotinian dialectic in favor of a more esoteric process of salvation; but it did lead Porphyry (see above) to look to astrology as a means of orienting the soul toward its place in the cosmos, and thereby allowing it to achieve the desired salvation in the most efficacious manner possible. Iamblichus, on the other hand, rejected even Porphyry's approach, in favor of a path toward the divinity that is more worthy of priests (hieratikoi) than philosophers; for Iamblichus believed that not only the One, but all the gods and demi-gods, exceed and transcend the individual soul, making it necessary for the soul seeking salvation to call upon the superior beings to aid it in its progress. This is accomplished, Iamblichus tells us, by "the perfective operation of unspeakable acts (erga) correctly performed ... acts which are beyond all understanding (huper pasan noêsin)" and which are "intelligible only to the gods" (On the Mysteries II.11.96-7, in Fowden, p. 132). These ritualistic acts, and the 'logic' underlying them, Iamblichus terms "theurgy" (theourgia). These theurgic acts are necessary, for Iamblichus, because he is convinced that philosophy, which is based solely upon thought (ennoia) -- and thought, we must remember, is always an accomplishment of the individual mind, and hence discursive -- is unable to reach that which is beyond thought. The practice of theurgy, then, becomes a way for the soul to experience the presence of the divinity, instead of merely thinking or conceptualizing the godhead. Porphyry took issue with this view, in his Letter to Anebo, which is really a criticism of the ideas of his pupil, Iamblichus, where he stated that, since theurgy is a physical process, it cannot possibly translate into a spiritual effect. Iamblichus' On the Mysteries was written as a reply to Porphyry's criticisms, but the defense of the pupil did not succeed in vanquishing the persistent attacks of the master. While both Porphyry and Iamblichus recognized, to a lesser and greater extent, respectively, the limitations of the Plotinian dialectic, Porphyry held firm to the idea that since the divinity is immaterial it can only be grasped in a noetic fashion -- i.e., discursively (and even astrology, in spite of its mediative capacity, is still an intellectual exercise, open to dialectic and narratization); Iamblichus, adhering roughly to the same view, nevertheless argued that the human soul must not think god on its own terms, but must allow itself to be transformed by the penetrating essence of god, of which the soul partakes through rituals intended to transform the particularized, fragmented soul into a being that is "pure and unchangeable" (cf. On the Mysteries I.12.42; Fowden, p. 133).

i. Theurgy and the Distrust of Dialectic

According to the schema of Plotinian dialectic, the 'stance' of the individual soul is the sole source of truth certainty, being a judging faculty dependent always upon the higher Soul. From the perspective of one who believes that the soul is immersed in Nature, instead of recognizing, as Plotinus did, the soul's status as an intimate governor of Nature (which is the Soul's own act), dialectic may very well appear as a solipsistic (and therefore faulty) attempt on the part of an individual mind to know its reality by imposing conceptual structures and strictures upon the phenomena that constitute this reality. Iamblichus believed that since every individual soul is immersed in the 'bodily element,' no soul is capable of understanding the divine nature through the pure exercise of human reason -- for reason itself, at the level of the human soul-body composite, is tainted by the changeable nature of matter, and therefore incapable of rising to that perfect knowledge that is beyond all change (cp. Plato, Phaedrus 247e). Dialectic, then, as the soul's attempt to know reality, is seen by Iamblichus as an attempt by an already fallen being to lead itself up out of the very locus of its own forgetfulness. Now Iamblichus does not completely reject dialectical reason; he simply requests that it be tempered by an appeal to intermediate divinities, who will aid the fallen soul in its ascent back towards the Supreme Good. The practice of ritualistic theurgy is the medium by which the fallen soul ascends to a point at which it becomes capable of engaging in a meaningful dialectic with the divinity. This dependence upon higher powers nevertheless negates the soul's own innate ability to think itself as god, and so we may say that Iamblichus' ideas represent a decisive break with the philosophy of Plotinus.

4. Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius

Proclus (410-485 CE) is, next to Plotinus, the most accomplished and rigorous of the Neoplatonists. Born in Constantinople, he studied philosophy in Athens, and through diligent effort rose to the rank of head teacher or 'scholarch' of that great school. In addition to his accomplishments in philosophy, Proclus was also a religious universalist, who had himself initiated into all the mystery religions being practiced during his time. This was doubtless due to the influence of Iamblichus, whom Proclus held in high esteem (cf. Proclus, Theology of Plato III; in Hegel, p. 432). The philosophical expression of Proclus is more precise and logically ordered than that of Plotinus. Indeed, Proclus posits the Intellect (nous) as the culmination of the productive act (paragein) of the One; this is in opposition to Plotinus, who described the Intellect as proceeding directly from the One, thereby placing Mind before Thought, and so making thought the process by which the Intellect becomes alienated from itself, thus requiring the salvific act in order to attain the fulfillment of Being, which is, for Plotinus, the return of Intellect to itself. Proclus understands the movement of existence as a tripartite progression beginning with an abstract unity, passing into a multiplicity that is identified with Life, and returning again to a unity that is no longer merely abstract, but now actualized as an eternal manifestation of the godhead. What constituted, for Plotinus, the salvific drama of human existence is, for Proclus, simply the logical, natural order of things. However, by thus removing the yearning for salvation from human existence, as something to be accomplished, positively, Proclus is ignoring or overly intellectualizing, if you will, an existential aspect of human existence that is as real as it is powerful. Plotinus recognized the importance of the salvific drive for the realization of true philosophy, making philosophy a means to an end; Proclus utilizes philosophy, rather, more in the manner of a useful, descriptive language by which a thinker may describe the essential realities of a merely contingent existence. In this sense, Proclus is more faithful to the 'letter' of Plato's Dialogues; but for this same reason he fails to rise to the 'spirit' of the Platonic philosophy. Proclus' major works include commentaries on Plato's Timaeus, Republic, Parmenides, Alcibiades I, and the Cratylus. He also wrote treatises on the Theology of Plato, On Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil. His most important work is undoubtedly the Elements of Theology, which contains the clearest exposition of his ideas.

a. Being -- Becoming -- Being

We found, in Plotinus, an explanation and expression of a cosmos that involved a gradual development from all but static unity toward eventual alienation -- a moment at which the active soul must make the profound decision to renounce autonomous existence and re-merge with the source of all Being, or else remain forever in the darkness of forgetfulness and error. Salvation, for Plotinus, was relatively easy to accomplish, but never guaranteed. For Proclus, on the other hand, the arkhê or 'ruling beginning' of all Life is the 'One-in-itself' (to auto hen), or that which is responsible for the ordering of all existents, insofar as existence is, in the last analysis, the sovereign act or expression of this primordial unity or monad. The expression of this One is perfectly balanced, being a trinity containing, as distinct expressions, each moment of self-realization of this One; and each of these moments, according to Proclus, have the structure of yet another trinity. The first trinity corresponds to the limit, which is the guide and reference-point of all further manifestations; the second to the unlimited, which is also Life or the productive power (dunamis); and the third, finally, to the 'mixture' (mikton, diakosmos), which is the self-reflective moment of return during which the soul realizes itself as a thinking -- i.e., living -- entity. Thought is, therefore, the culmination of Life and the fulfillment of Being. Thought is also the reason (logos) that binds these triadic unities together in a grand harmonious plêrôma, if you will. Being, for Proclus, is that divine self-presence, "shut up without development and maintained in strict isolation" (Hegel, p. 446) which is the object of Life's thinking; this 'object' gives rise to that thinking which leads, eventually, to understanding (nous), which is the thought of being, and appears (ekphanôs), always, as 'being's begetter'. When the circle is completed, and reflected upon, logically, we are met with the following onto-cosmological schema: thought (noêtos, also known as 'Being') giving rise to its "negative" which is thinking (Hegel, p. 393) and the thought 'it is' (noêtos kai noêros), produces its own precise reflection -- 'pure thinking' -- and this reflection is the very manifestation (phanerôsis) of the deity within the fluctuating arena of individual souls. Being is eternal and static precisely because it always returns to itself as Being; and 'Becoming'is the conceptual term for this process, which involves the cyclical play between that which is and is not, at any given time. "[T]he thought of every man is identical with the existence of every man, and each is both the thought and the existence" (Proclus, Platonic Theology III., in Hegel, p. 449). The autonomous drive toward dissolution, which is so germane to the soul as such, is wiped away by Proclus, for his dialectic is impeccably clean. However, he does not account for the yearning for the infinite (as does Plotinus) and the consequent existential desire for productive power falls on its face before the supreme god of autonomous creation -- which draws all existents into its primeval web of dissolution.

b. The God Beyond Being

Very little is known about the life of the so-called Pseudo-Dionysius. For many centuries, the writings of this mystical philosopher were believed to have been from the pen of none other Dionysius, the disciple of St. Paul. Later scholarship has shed considerable doubt on this claim, and most modern scholars believe this author to have been active during the late fifth century CE. Indeed, the earliest reference to the Dionysian Corpus that we possess is from 533 CE. There is no mention of this author's work before this date. Careful study of the Pseudo-Dionysian writings has uncovered many parallels between the theurgical doctrines of Iamblichus, and the triadic metaphysical schema of Proclus. Yet what we witness in these writings is the attempt by a thinker who is at once religiously sensitive and philosophically engaged to bring the highly developed Platonism of his time into line with a Christian theological tradition that was apparently persisting on the fringes of orthodoxy. To this extent, we may refer to the Pseudo-Dionysius as a 'decadent,' for he (or she?) was writing at a time when the heyday of Platonism had attained the status of a palaios logos ('ancient teaching') to be, not merely commented upon, but savored as an aesthetic monument to an era already long past. It is important to note, in this regard, that the writings of Pseudo-Dionysius do not contain any theoretical arguments or dialectical moments, but simply many subtle variations on the apophatic/kataphatic theology for which our writer is renowned. Indeed, he writes as if his readers already know, and are merely in need of clarification. His message is quite simple, and is manifestly distilled from the often cumbersome doctrines of earlier thinkers (especially Iamblichus and Proclus). Pseudo-Dionysius professes a God who is beyond all distinctions, and who even transcends the means utilized by human beings to reach Him. For Pseudo-Dionysius, the Holy Trinity (which is probably analogous to Proclus' highest trinity, see above) serves as a "guide" to the human being who seeks not only to know but to unite with "him who is beyond all being and knowledge" (Pseudo-Dionysius, The Mystical Theology 997A-1000A, tr. C. Luibheid 1987). In the expression of the Pseudo-Dionysius the yearning for the infinite reaches a poetical form that at once fulfills and exceeds philosophy.

5. Appendix:`The Renaissance Platonists

After the closing of the Neoplatonic Academy in Athens by the Emperor Justinian in 529 CE, Platonism ceased to be a living philosophy. Due to the efforts of the Christian philosopher Boethius (480-525 CE), who translated Porphyry's Isagoge, and composed numerous original works as well, the Middle Ages received a faint glimmer of the ancient glories of the Platonic philosophy. St. Augustine, also, was responsible for imparting a sense of Neoplatonic doctrine to the Latin West, but this was by way of commentary and critique, and not in any way a systematic exposition of the philosophy. Generally speaking, it is safe to say that the European Middle Ages remained in the grip of Aristotelianism until the early Renaissance, when certain brilliant Italian thinkers began to rediscover, translate, and expound upon the original texts of Platonism. Chief among these thinkers were Marsilio Ficino (1433-1492) and Pico della Mirandola (1463-1494). Ficino produced fine Latin translations of Plato's Dialogues, the Enneads of Plotinus, and numerous works by Porphyry, Iamblichus, Proclus, Pseudo-Dionysius, and many others. In addition to his scholarly ability, Ficino was also a fine commentator and philosopher in his own right. His brilliant essay on Five Questions Concerning The Mind is a concise summary of general Neoplatonic doctrine, based upon Ficino's own view that the lot of the human soul is to inquire into its own nature, and that since this inquiry causes the human soul to experience misery, the soul must do everything it can to transcend the physical body and live a life worthy of the blessed angels (cf. Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 211-212). Giovanni Pico, the Count of Mirandola, was a colorful figure who lived a short life, fraught with strife. He roused the ire of the papacy by composing a voluminous work defending nine-hundred theses drawn from his vast reading of the Ancients; thirteen of these theses were deemed heretical by the papacy, and yet Pico refused to change or withdraw a single one. Like his friend Ficino, Pico was a devotee of ancient wisdom, drawing not only upon the Platonic canon, but also upon the Pre-Socratic literature and the Hermetic Corpus, especially the Poimandres. Pico's most famous work is the Oration on the Dignity of Man, in which he eloquently states his learned view that humankind was created by God "as a creature of indeterminate nature," possessed of the unique ability to ascend or descend on the scale of Being through the autonomous exercise of free will (Oration 3, in Cassirer, et. al. (ed) 1948, p. 224). Pico's view of free will was quite different from that expressed by Plotinus, and indeed most other Neoplatonists, and it came as no surprise when Pico composed a treatise On Being and the One which ended on Aristotelian terms, declaring the One to be coincident with or persisting amidst Being -- a wholly un-Platonic doctrine. With Ficino, then, we may say that Platonism achieved a brief moment of archaic glory, while with Pico, it was plunged once again into the quagmire of self-referential empiricism.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Cassirer, Ernst; Kristeller, Paul Oskar; Randall, John Herman Jr. (editors) The Renaissance Philosophy of Man (University of Chicago Press 1948).
  • Cooper, John M. (ed.), Plato: Complete Works (Hackett Publishing 1997).
  • Copleston S.J., Frederick, A History of Philosophy (vol. I, part II): Greece and Rome (Image Books 1962).
  • Dillon, John (1977), The Middle Platonists (Cornell University Press).
  • Eusebius (tr. G.A. Williamson 1965), The History of the Church (Penguin Books).
  • Fowden, Garth, The Egyptian Hermes: A Historical Approach To The Late Pagan Mind (Cambridge University Press 1986).
  • Hadot, Pierre (tr. M. Chase), Plotinus, or The Simplicity of Vision (University of Chicago Press 1993).
  • Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich (tr. E.S. Haldane and Frances H. Simson), Lectures on the History of Philosophy (vol. II): Plato And The Platonists (Bison Books 1995).
  • Jaeger, Werner, Early Christianity and Greek Paideia (Harvard University Press 1961).
  • Layton, Bentley (1987), The Gnostic Scriptures (Doubleday: The Anchor Bible Reference Library).
  • O'Brien S.J., Elmer (1964), The Essential Plotinus: Representative Treatises From The Enneads (Hackett Publishing).
  • Origen of Alexandria, Commentary on John, tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. X. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Origen of Alexandria, On First Principles [De Principiis], tr. in The Ante-Nicene Fathers, vol. IV. (Eerdmans 1979, reprint).
  • Philo of Alexandria (tr. F.H. Colson and G.H. Whitaker), On the Creation of the World [De Opificio Mundi], in vol. 1 of The Loeb Classical Library edition of Philo (Harvard University Press 1929).
  • Plotinus (tr. A.H. Armstrong), The Enneads, in seven volumes (Loeb Classical Library: Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Porphyry (tr. K. Guthrie), Launching-Points to the Realm of Mind [Pros ta noeta aphorismoi] (Phanes Press 1988).
  • Porphyry (tr. A. Zimmern), Porphyry's Letter to His Wife Marcella Concerning the Life of Philosophy and the Ascent to the Gods (Phanes Press 1986).
  • Porphyry (tr. A.H. Armstrong), Life of Plotinus [Vita Plotini], in volume one of the Loeb Classical Library edition of Plotinus (Harvard University Press 1966).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Lost Fragments of Proclus (Wizards Bookshelf 1988).
  • Proclus (tr. T. Taylor), Ten Doubts Concerning Providence, and On the Subsistence of Evil (Ares Publishers 1980).
  • Pseudo-Dionysius (tr. C. Luibheid 1987), Pseudo-Dionysius: The Complete Works (Paulist Press).

Author Information

Edward Moore
St. Elias School of Orthodox Theology
U. S. A.


Relativism is sometimes identified (usually by its critics) as the thesis that all points of view are equally valid. In ethics, this amounts to saying that all moralities are equally good; in epistemology it implies that all beliefs, or belief systems, are equally true. Critics of relativism typically dismiss such views as incoherent since they imply the validity even of the view that relativism is false. They also charge that such views are pernicious since they undermine the enterprise of trying to improve our ways of thinking.

Perhaps because relativism is associated with such views, few philosophers are willing to describe themselves as relativists. However, most of the leading thinkers who have been accused of relativism--for example, Ludwig Wittgenstein, Peter Winch, Thomas Kuhn, Richard Rorty, Michel Foucault, Jacques Derrida--do share a certain common ground which, while recognizably relativistic, provides a basis for more sophisticated, and perhaps more defensible, positions.

Although there are many different kinds of relativism, they all have two features in common.

(1) They all assert that one thing (e.g. moral values, beauty, knowledge, taste, or meaning) is relative to some particular framework or standpoint (e.g. the individual subject, a culture, an era, a language, or a conceptual scheme).

(2) They all deny that any standpoint is uniquely privileged over all others.

It is thus possible to classify the different types and sub-types of relativism in a fairly obvious way. The main genera of relativism can be distinguished according to the object they seek to relativize. Thus, forms of moral relativism assert the relativity of moral values; forms of epistemological relativism assert the relativity of knowledge. These genera can then be broken down into distinct species by identifying the framework to which the object in question is being relativized. For example, moral subjectivism is that species of moral relativism that relativizes moral value to the individual subject.

How controversial, and how coherent, these forms of relativism are will obviously vary according to what is being relativized to what, and in what manner. In contemporary philosophy, the most widely discussed forms of relativism are moral relativism, cognitive relativism, and aesthetic relativism.

Author Information

Emrys Westacott
Alfred University
U. S. A.

Anselm: Ontological Argument for God's Existence

One of the most fascinating arguments for the existence of an all-perfect God is the ontological argument. While there are several different versions of the argument, all purport to show that it is self-contradictory to deny that there exists a greatest possible being. Thus, on this general line of argument, it is a necessary truth that such a being exists; and this being is the God of traditional Western theism. This article explains and evaluates classic and contemporary versions of the ontological argument.

Most of the arguments for God's existence rely on at least one empirical premise. For example, the "fine-tuning" version of the design argument depends on empirical evidence of intelligent design; in particular, it turns on the empirical claim that, as a nomological matter, that is, as a matter of law, life could not have developed if certain fundamental properties of the universe were to have differed even slightly from what they are. Likewise, cosmological arguments depend on certain empirical claims about the explanation for the occurrence of empirical events.

In contrast, the ontological arguments are conceptual in roughly the following sense: just as the propositions constituting the concept of a bachelor imply that every bachelor is male, the propositions constituting the concept of God, according to the ontological argument, imply that God exists. There is, of course, this difference: whereas the concept of a bachelor explicitly contains the proposition that bachelors are unmarried, the concept of God does not explicitly contain any proposition asserting the existence of such a being. Even so, the basic idea is the same: ontological arguments attempt to show that we can deduce God's existence from, so to speak, the very definition of God.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction: The Non-Empirical Nature of the Ontological Arguments
  2. The Classic Version of the Ontological Argument
    1. The Argument Described
    2. Gaunilo's Criticism
    3. Aquinas's Criticisms
    4. Kant's Criticism: Is Existence a Perfection?
  3. Anselm's Second Version of the Ontological Argument
  4. Modal Versions of the Argument
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction: The Non-Empirical Nature of the Ontological Arguments

It is worth reflecting for a moment on what a remarkable (and beautiful!) undertaking it is to deduce God's existence from the very definition of God. Normally, existential claims don't follow from conceptual claims. If I want to prove that bachelors, unicorns, or viruses exist, it is not enough just to reflect on the concepts. I need to go out into the world and conduct some sort of empirical investigation using my senses. Likewise, if I want to prove that bachelors, unicorns, or viruses don't exist, I must do the same. In general, positive and negative existential claims can be established only by empirical methods.

There is, however, one class of exceptions. We can prove certain negative existential claims merely by reflecting on the content of the concept. Thus, for example, we can determine that there are no square circles in the world without going out and looking under every rock to see whether there is a square circle there. We can do so merely by consulting the definition and seeing that it is self-contradictory. Thus, the very concepts imply that there exist no entities that are both square and circular.

The ontological argument, then, is unique among such arguments in that it purports to establish the real (as opposed to abstract) existence of some entity. Indeed, if the ontological arguments succeed, it is as much a contradiction to suppose that God doesn't exist as it is to suppose that there are square circles or female bachelors. In the following sections, we will evaluate a number of different attempts to develop this astonishing strategy.

2. The Classic Version of the Ontological Argument

a. The Argument Described

St. Anselm, Archbishop of Cantebury (1033-1109), is the originator of the ontological argument, which he describes in the Proslogium as follows:

[Even a] fool, when he hears of … a being than which nothing greater can be conceived … understands what he hears, and what he understands is in his understanding.… And assuredly that, than which nothing greater can be conceived, cannot exist in the understanding alone. For suppose it exists in the understanding alone: then it can be conceived to exist in reality; which is greater.… Therefore, if that, than which nothing greater can be conceived, exists in the understanding alone, the very being, than which nothing greater can be conceived, is one, than which a greater can be conceived. But obviously this is impossible. Hence, there is no doubt that there exists a being, than which nothing greater can be conceived, and it exists both in the understanding and in reality.

The argument in this difficult passage can accurately be summarized in standard form:

  1. It is a conceptual truth (or, so to speak, true by definition) that God is a being than which none greater can be imagined (that is, the greatest possible being that can be imagined).
  2. God exists as an idea in the mind.
  3. A being that exists as an idea in the mind and in reality is, other things being equal, greater than a being that exists only as an idea in the mind.
  4. Thus, if God exists only as an idea in the mind, then we can imagine something that is greater than God (that is, a greatest possible being that does exist).
  5. But we cannot imagine something that is greater than God (for it is a contradiction to suppose that we can imagine a being greater than the greatest possible being that can be imagined.)
  6. Therefore, God exists.

Intuitively, one can think of the argument as being powered by two ideas. The first, expressed by Premise 2, is that we have a coherent idea of a being that instantiates all of the perfections. Otherwise put, Premise 2 asserts that we have a coherent idea of a being that instantiates every property that makes a being greater, other things being equal, than it would have been without that property (such properties are also known as "great-making" properties). Premise 3 asserts that existence is a perfection or great-making property.

Accordingly, the very concept of a being that instantiates all the perfections implies that it exists. Suppose B is a being that instantiates all the perfections and suppose B doesn't exist (in reality). Since Premise 3 asserts that existence is a perfection, it follows that B lacks a perfection. But this contradicts the assumption that B is a being that instantiates all the perfections. Thus, according to this reasoning, it follows that B exists.

b. Gaunilo's Criticism

Gaunilo of Marmoutier, a monk and contemporary of Anselm's, is responsible for one of the most important criticisms of Anselm's argument. It is quite reasonable to worry that Anselm's argument illegitimately moves from the existence of an idea to the existence of a thing that corresponds to the idea. As the objection is sometimes put, Anselm simply defines things into existence-and this cannot be done.

Gaunilo shared this worry, believing that one could use Anselm's argument to show the existence of all kinds of non-existent things:

Now if some one should tell me that there is … an island [than which none greater can be conceived], I should easily understand his words, in which there is no difficulty. But suppose that he went on to say, as if by a logical inference: "You can no longer doubt that this island which is more excellent than all lands exists somewhere, since you have no doubt that it is in your understanding. And since it is more excellent not to be in the understanding alone, but to exist both in the understanding and in reality, for this reason it must exist. For if it does not exist, any land which really exists will be more excellent than it; and so the island understood by you to be more excellent will not be more excellent."

Gaunilo's argument, thus, proceeds by attempting to use Anselm's strategy to deduce the existence of a perfect island, which Gaunilo rightly views as a counterexample to the argument form. The counterexample can be expressed as follows:

  1. It is a conceptual truth that a piland is an island than which none greater can be imagined (that is, the greatest possible island that can be imagined).
  2. A piland exists as an idea in the mind.
  3. A piland that exists as an idea in the mind and in reality is greater than a piland that exists only as an idea in the mind.
  4. Thus, if a piland exists only as an idea in the mind, then we can imagine an island that is greater than a piland (that is, a greatest possible island that does exist).
  5. But we cannot imagine an island that is greater than a piland.
  6. Therefore, a piland exists.

Notice, however, that premise 1 of Gaunilo's argument is incoherent. The problem here is that the qualities that make an island great are not the sort of qualities that admit of conceptually maximal qualities. No matter how great any island is in some respect, it is always possible to imagine an island greater than that island in that very respect. For example, if one thinks that abundant fruit is a great-making property for an island, then, no matter how great a particular island might be, it will always be possible to imagine a greater island because there is no intrinsic maximum for fruit-abundance. For this reason, the very concept of a piland is incoherent.

But this is not true of the concept of God as Anselm conceives it. Properties like knowledge, power, and moral goodness, which comprise the concept of a maximally great being, do have intrinsic maximums. For example, perfect knowledge requires knowing all and only true propositions; it is conceptually impossible to know more than this. Likewise, perfect power means being able to do everything that it is possible to do; it is conceptually impossible for a being to be able to do more than this.

The general point here, then, is this: Anselm's argument works, if at all, only for concepts that are entirely defined in terms of properties that admit of some sort of intrinsic maximum. As C.D. Broad puts this important point:

[The notion of a greatest possible being imaginable assumes that] each positive property is to be present in the highest possible degree. Now this will be meaningless verbiage unless there is some intrinsic maximum or upper limit to the possible intensity of every positive property which is capable of degrees. With some magnitudes this condition is fulfilled. It is, e.g., logically impossible that any proper fraction should exceed the ratio 1/1; and again, on a certain definition of "angle," it is logically impossible for any angle to exceed four right angles. But it seems quite clear that there are other properties, such as length or temperature or pain, to which there is no intrinsic maximum or upper limit of degree.

If any of the properties that are conceptually essential to the notion of God do not admit of an intrinsic maximum, then Anselm's argument strategy will not work because, like Guanilo's concept of a piland, the relevant concept of God is incoherent. But insofar as the relevant great-making properties are limited to omnipotence, omniscience, and moral perfection (which do admit of intrinsic maximums), Anselm's notion of a greatest possible being seems to avoid the worry expressed by Broad and Guanilo.

c. Aquinas's Criticisms

While St. Thomas Aquinas (1224-1274) believed that God's existence is self-evident, he rejected the idea that it can be deduced from claims about the concept of God. Aquinas argued, plausibly enough, that "not everyone who hears this word 'God' understands it to signify something than which nothing greater can be thought, seeing that some have believed God to be a body." The idea here is that, since different people have different concepts of God, this argument works, if at all, only to convince those who define the notion of God in the same way.

The problem with this criticism is that the ontological argument can be restated without defining God. To see this, simply delete premise 1 and replace each instance of "God" with "A being than which none greater can be conceived." The conclusion, then, will be that a being than which none greater can be conceived exists - and it is, of course, quite natural to name this being God.

Nevertheless, Aquinas had a second problem with the ontological argument. On Aquinas's view, even if we assume that everyone shares the same concept of God as a being than which none greater can be imagined, "it does not therefore follow that he understands what the word signifies exists actually, but only that it exists mentally."

One natural interpretation of this somewhat ambiguous passage is that Aquinas is rejecting premise 2 of Anselm's argument on the ground that, while we can rehearse the words "a being than which none greater can be imagined" in our minds, we have no idea of what this sequence of words really means. On this view, God is unlike any other reality known to us; while we can easily understand concepts of finite things, the concept of an infinitely great being dwarfs finite human understanding. We can, of course, try to associate the phrase "a being than which none greater can be imagined" with more familiar finite concepts, but these finite concepts are so far from being an adequate description of God, that it is fair to say they don't help us to get a detailed idea of God.

Nevertheless, the success of the argument doesn't depend on our having a complete understanding of the concept of a being than which none greater can be conceived. Consider, for example, that, while we don't have a complete understanding (whatever this means) of the concept of a natural number than which none larger can be imagined, we understand it well enough to see that there does not exist such a number. No more complete understanding of the concept of a maximally great being than this is required, on Anselm's view, to successfully make the argument. If the concept is coherent, then even a minimal understanding of the concept is sufficient to make the argument.

d. Kant's Criticism: Is Existence a Perfection?

Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) directs his famous objection at premise 3's claim that a being that exists as an idea in the mind and in reality is greater than a being that exists only as an idea in the mind. According to premise 3, existence is what's known as a great-making property or, as the matter is sometimes put, a perfection. Premise 3 thus entails that (1) existence is a property; and (2) instantiating existence makes a thing better, other things being equal, than it would have been otherwise.

Kant rejects premise 3 on the ground that, as a purely formal matter, existence does not function as a predicate. As Kant puts the point:

Being is evidently not a real predicate, that is, a conception of something which is added to the conception of some other thing. It is merely the positing of a thing, or of certain determinations in it. Logically, it is merely the copula of a judgement. The proposition, God is omnipotent, contains two conceptions, which have a certain object or content; the word is, is no additional predicate-it merely indicates the relation of the predicate to the subject. Now if I take the subject (God) with all its predicates (omnipotence being one), and say, God is, or There is a God, I add no new predicate to the conception of God, I merely posit or affirm the existence of the subject with all its predicates - I posit the object in relation to my conception.

Accordingly, what goes wrong with the first version of the ontological argument is that the notion of existence is being treated as the wrong logical type. Concepts, as a logical matter, are defined entirely in terms of logical predicates. Since existence isn't a logical predicate, it doesn't belong to the concept of God; it rather affirms that the existence of something that satisfies the predicates defining the concept of God.

While Kant's criticism is phrased (somewhat obscurely) in terms of the logic of predicates and copulas, it also makes a plausible metaphysical point. Existence is not a property (in, say, the way that being red is a property of an apple). Rather it is a precondition for the instantiation of properties in the following sense: it is not possible for a non-existent thing to instantiate any properties because there is nothing to which, so to speak, a property can stick. Nothing has no qualities whatsoever. To say that x instantiates a property P is hence to presuppose that x exists. Thus, on this line of reasoning, existence isn't a great-making property because it is not a property at all; it is rather a metaphysically necessary condition for the instantiation of any properties.

But even if we concede that existence is a property, it does not seem to be the sort of property that makes something better for having it. Norman Malcolm expresses the argument as follows:

The doctrine that existence is a perfection is remarkably queer. It makes sense and is true to say that my future house will be a better one if it is insulated than if it is not insulated; but what could it mean to say that it will be a better house if it exists than if it does not? My future child will be a better man if he is honest than if he is not; but who would understand the saying that he will be a better man if he exists than if he does not? Or who understands the saying that if God exists He is more perfect than if he does not exist? One might say, with some intelligibility, that it would be better (for oneself or for mankind) if God exists than if He does not-but that is a different matter.

The idea here is that existence is very different from, say, the property of lovingness. A being that is loving is, other things being equal, better or greater than a being that is not. But it seems very strange to think that a loving being that exists is, other things being equal, better or greater than a loving being that doesn't exist. But to the extent that existence doesn't add to the greatness of a thing, the classic version of the ontological argument fails.

3. Anselm's Second Version of the Ontological Argument

As it turns out, there are two different versions of the ontological argument in the Prosologium. The second version does not rely on the highly problematic claim that existence is a property and hence avoids many of the objections to the classic version. Here is the second version of the ontological argument as Anselm states it:

God is that, than which nothing greater can be conceived.… And [God] assuredly exists so truly, that it cannot be conceived not to exist. For, it is possible to conceive of a being which cannot be conceived not to exist; and this is greater than one which can be conceived not to exist. Hence, if that, than which nothing greater can be conceived, can be conceived not to exist, it is not that, than which nothing greater can be conceived. But this is an irreconcilable contradiction. There is, then, so truly a being than which nothing greater can be conceived to exist, that it cannot even be conceived not to exist; and this being thou art, O Lord, our God.

This version of the argument relies on two important claims. As before, the argument includes a premise asserting that God is a being than which a greater cannot be conceived. But this version of the argument, unlike the first, does not rely on the claim that existence is a perfection; instead it relies on the claim that necessary existence is a perfection. This latter claim asserts that a being whose existence is necessary is greater than a being whose existence is not necessary. Otherwise put, then, the second key claim is that a being whose non-existence is logically impossible is greater than a being whose non-existence is logically possible.

More formally, the argument is this:

  1. By definition, God is a being than which none greater can be imagined.
  2. A being that necessarily exists in reality is greater than a being that does not necessarily exist.
  3. Thus, by definition, if God exists as an idea in the mind but does not necessarily exist in reality, then we can imagine something that is greater than God.
  4. But we cannot imagine something that is greater than God.
  5. Thus, if God exists in the mind as an idea, then God necessarily exists in reality.
  6. God exists in the mind as an idea.
  7. Therefore, God necessarily exists in reality.

This second version appears to be less vulnerable to Kantian criticisms than the first. To begin with, necessary existence, unlike mere existence, seems clearly to be a property. Notice, for example, that the claim that x necessarily exists entails a number of claims that attribute particular properties to x. For example, if x necessarily exists, then its existence does not depend on the existence of any being (unlike contingent human beings whose existence depends, at the very least, on the existence of their parents). And this seems to entail that x has the reason for its existence in its own nature. But these latter claims clearly attribute particular properties to x.

And only a claim that attributes a particular property can entail claims that attribute particular properties. While the claim that x exists clearly entails that x has at least one property, this does not help. We cannot soundly infer any claims that attribute particular properties to x from either the claim that x exists or the claim that x has at least one property; indeed, the claim that x has at least one property no more expresses a particular property than the claim that x exists. This distinguishes the claim that x exists from the claim that x necessarily exists and hence seems to imply that the latter, and only the latter, expresses a property.

Moreover, one can plausibly argue that necessary existence is a great-making property. To say that a being necessarily exists is to say that it exists eternally in every logically possible world; such a being is not just, so to speak, indestructible in this world, but indestructible in every logically possible world - and this does seem, at first blush, to be a great-making property. As Malcolm puts the point:

If a housewife has a set of extremely fragile dishes, then as dishes, they are inferior to those of another set like them in all respects except that they are not fragile. Those of the first set are dependent for their continued existence on gentle handling; those of the second set are not. There is a definite connection between the notions of dependency and inferiority, and independence and superiority. To say that something which was dependent on nothing whatever was superior to anything that was dependent on any way upon anything is quite in keeping with the everyday use of the terms superior and greater.

Nevertheless, the matter is not so clear as Malcolm believes. It might be the case that, other things being equal, a set of dishes that is indestructible in this world is greater than a set of dishes that is not indestructible in this world. But it is very hard to see how transworld indestructibility adds anything to the greatness of a set of dishes that is indestructible in this world. From our perspective, there is simply nothing to be gained by adding transworld indestructibility to a set of dishes that is actually indestructible. There is simply nothing that a set of dishes that is indestructible in every possible world can do in this world that can't be done by a set of dishes that is indestructible in this world but not in every other world.

And the same seems to be true of God. Suppose that an omniscient, omnipotent, omnibenevolent, eternal (and hence, so to speak, indestructible), personal God exists in this world but not in some other worlds. It is very hard to make sense of the claim that such a God is deficient in some relevant respect. God's indestructibility in this world means that God exists eternally in all logically possible worlds that resemble this one in certain salient respects. It is simply unclear how existence in these other worlds that bear no resemblance to this one would make God greater and hence more worthy of worship. From our perspective, necessary existence adds nothing in value to eternal existence. If this is correct, then Anselm's second version of the argument also fails.

4. Modal Versions of the Argument

Even if, however, we assume that Anselm's second version of the argument can be defended against such objections, there is a further problem: it isn't very convincing because it is so difficult to tell whether the argument is sound. Thus, the most important contemporary defender of the argument, Alvin Plantinga, complains "[a]t first sight, Anselm's argument is remarkably unconvincing if not downright irritating; it looks too much like a parlor puzzle or word magic." As a result, despite its enduring importance, the ontological argument has brought few people to theism.

There have been several attempts to render the persuasive force of the ontological argument more transparent by recasting it using the logical structures of contemporary modal logic. One influential attempts to ground the ontological argument in the notion of God as an unlimited being. As Malcolm describes this idea:

God is usually conceived of as an unlimited being. He is conceived of as a being who could not be limited, that is, as an absolutely unlimited being.… If God is conceived to be an absolutely unlimited being He must be conceived to be unlimited in regard to His existence as well as His operation. In this conception it will not make sense to say that He depends on anything for coming into or continuing in existence. Nor, as Spinoza observed, will it make sense to say that something could prevent Him from existing. Lack of moisture can prevent trees from existing in a certain region of the earth. But it would be contrary to the concept of God as an unlimited being to suppose that anything … could prevent Him from existing.

The unlimited character of God, then, entails that his existence is different from ours in this respect: while our existence depends causally on the existence of other beings (e.g., our parents), God's existence does not depend causally on the existence of any other being.

Further, on Malcolm's view, the existence of an unlimited being is either logically necessary or logically impossible. Here is his argument for this important claim. Either an unlimited being exists at world W or it doesn't exist at world W; there are no other possibilities. If an unlimited being does not exist in W, then its nonexistence cannot be explained by reference to any causally contingent feature of W; accordingly, there is no contingent feature of W that explains why that being doesn't exist. Now suppose, per reductio, an unlimited being exists in some other world W'. If so, then it must be some contingent feature f of W' that explains why that being exists in that world. But this entails that the nonexistence of an unlimited being in W can be explained by the absence of f in W; and this contradicts the claim that its nonexistence in W can't be explained by reference to any causally contingent feature. Thus, if God doesn't exist at W, then God doesn't exist in any logically possible world.

A very similar argument can be given for the claim that an unlimited being exists in every logically possible world if it exists in some possible world W; the details are left for the interested reader. Since there are only two possibilities with respect to W and one entails the impossibility of an unlimited being and the other entails the necessity of an unlimited being, it follows that the existence of an unlimited being is either logically necessary or logically impossible.

All that is left, then, to complete Malcolm's elegant version of the proof is the premise that the existence of an unlimited being is not logically impossible - and this seems plausible enough. The existence of an unlimited being is logically impossible only if the concept of an unlimited being is self-contradictory. Since we have no reason, on Malcolm's view to think the existence of an unlimited being is self-contradictory, it follows that an unlimited being, i.e., God, exists. Here's the argument reduced to its basic elements:

  1. God is, as a conceptual matter (that is, as a matter of definition) an unlimited being.
  2. The existence of an unlimited being is either logically necessary or logically impossible.
  3. The existence of an unlimited being is not logically impossible.
  4. Therefore, the existence of God is logically necessary.

Notice that Malcolm's version of the argument does not turn on the claim that necessary existence is a great-making property. Rather, as we saw above, Malcolm attempts to argue that there are only two possibilities with respect to the existence of an unlimited being: either it is necessary or it is impossible. And notice that his argument does not turn in any way on characterizing the property necessary existence as making something that instantiates that property better than it would be without it. Thus, Malcolm's version of the argument is not vulnerable to the criticisms of Anselm's claim that necessary existence is a perfection.

But while Malcolm's version of the argument is, moreover, considerably easier to understand than Anselm's versions, it is also vulnerable to objection. In particular, Premise 2 is not obviously correct. The claim that an unlimited being B exists at some world W clearly entails that B always exists at W (that is, that B's existence is eternal or everlasting in W), but this doesn't clearly entail that B necessarily exists (that is, that B exists at every logically possible world). To defend this further claim, one needs to give an argument that the notion of a contingent eternal being is self-contradictory.

Similarly, the claim that an unlimited being B does not exist at W clearly entails that B never exists at W (that is, that it is always true in W that B doesn't exist), but it doesn't clearly entail that B necessarily doesn't exist (that is, B exists at no logically possible world or B's existence is logically impossible. Indeed, there are plenty of beings that will probably never exist in this world that exist in other logically possible worlds, like unicorns. For this reason, Premise 2 of Malcolm's version is questionable.

Perhaps the most influential of contemporary modal arguments is Plantinga's version. Plantinga begins by defining two properties, the property of maximal greatness and the property of maximal excellence, as follows:

  1. A being is maximally excellent in a world W if and only if it is omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect in W; and
  2. A being is maximally great in a world W if and only if it is maximally excellent in every possible world.

Thus, maximal greatness entails existence in every possible world: since a being that is maximally great at W is omnipotent at every possible world and non-existent beings can't be omnipotent, it follows that a maximally great being exists in every logically possible world.

Accordingly, the trick is to show that a maximally great being exists in some world W because it immediately follows from this claim that such a being exists in every world, including our own. But notice that the claim that a maximally great being exists in some world is logically equivalent to the claim that the concept of a maximally great being is not self-contradictory; for the only things that don't exist in any possible world are things that are conceptually defined in terms of contradictory properties. There is no logically possible world in which a square circle exists (given the relevant concepts) because the property of being square is inconsistent with the property of being circular.

Since, on Plantinga's view, the concept of a maximally great being is consistent and hence possibly instantiated, it follows that such a being, i.e., God, exists in every possible world. Here is a schematic representation of the argument:

  1. The concept of a maximally great being is self-consistent.
  2. If 1, then there is at least one logically possible world in which a maximally great being exists.
  3. Therefore, there is at least one logically possible world in which a maximally great being exists.
  4. If a maximally great being exists in one logically possible world, it exists in every logically possible world.
  5. Therefore, a maximally great being (that is, God) exists in every logically possible world.

It is sometimes objected that Plantinga's Premise 4 is an instance of a controversial general modal principle. The S5 system of modal logic includes an axiom that looks suspiciously similar to Premise 4:

AxS5: If A is possible, then it is necessarily true that A is possible.

The intuition underlying AxS5 is, as James Sennett puts it, that "all propositions bear their modal status necessarily." But, according to this line of criticism, Plantinga's version is unconvincing insofar as it rests on a controversial principle of modal logic.

To see that this criticism is unfounded, it suffices to make two observations. First, notice that the following propositions are not logically equivalent:

PL4 If "A maximally great being exists" is possible, then "A maximally great being exists" is necessarily true.

PL4* If "A maximally great being exists" is possible, then it is necessarily true that "A maximally great being exists" is possible.

PL4 is, of course, Plantinga's Premise 4 slightly reworded, while PL4* is simply a straightforward instance of AxS5. While PL4 implies PL4* (since if A is true at every world, it is possible at every world), PL4* doesn't imply PL4; for PL4 clearly makes a much stronger claim than PL4*.

Second, notice that the argument for Premise 4 does not make any reference to the claim that all propositions bear their modal status necessarily. Plantinga simply builds necessary existence into the very notion of maximal greatness. Since, by definition, a being that is maximally great at W is omnipotent at every possible world and a being that does not exist at some world W' cannot be omnipotent at W', it straightforwardly follows, without the help of anything like the controversial S5 axiom, that a maximally great being exists in every logically possible world.

Indeed, it is for this very reason that Plantinga avoids the objection to Malcolm's argument that was considered above. Since the notion of maximal greatness, in contrast to the notion of an unlimited being as Malcolm defines it, is conceived in terms that straightforwardly entail existence in every logically possible world (and hence eternal existence in every logically possible world), there are no worries about whether maximal greatness, in contrast to unlimitedness, entails something stronger than eternal existence.

IV. Is the Concept of a Maximally Great Being Coherent?

As is readily evident, each version of the ontological argument rests on the assumption that the concept of God, as it is described in the argument, is self-consistent. Both versions of Anselm's argument rely on the claim that the idea of God (that is, a being than which none greater can be conceived) "exists as an idea in the understanding." Similarly, Plantinga's version relies on the more transparent claim that the concept of maximal greatness is self-consistent.

But many philosophers are skeptical about the underlying assumption, as Leibniz describes it, "that this idea of the all-great or all-perfect being is possible and implies no contradiction." Here is the problem as C.D. Broad expresses it:

Let us suppose, e.g., that there were just three positive properties X, Y, and Z; that any two of them are compatible with each other; but that the presence of any two excludes the remaining one. Then there would be three possible beings, namely, one which combines X and Y, one which combines Y and Z, and one which combines Z and X, each of which would be such that nothing … superior to it is logically possible. For the only kind of being which would be … superior to any of these would be one which had all three properties, X, Y, and Z; and, by hypothesis, this combination is logically impossible.… It is now plain that, unless all positive properties be compatible with each other, this phrase [i.e., "a being than which none greater can be imagined"] is just meaningless verbiage like the phrase "the greatest possible integer."

Thus, if there are two great-making characteristics essential to the classically theistic notion of an all-perfect God that are logically incompatible, it follows that this notion is incoherent.

Here it is important to note that all versions of the ontological argument assume that God is simultaneously omnipotent, omniscient, and morally perfect. As we have seen, Plantinga expressly defines maximal excellence in such terms. Though Anselm doesn't expressly address the issue, it is clear (1) that he is attempting to show the existence of the God of classical theism; and (2) that the great-making properties include those of omnipotence, omniscience, and moral perfection.

There are a number of plausible arguments for thinking that even this restricted set of properties is logically inconsistent. For example, moral perfection is thought to entail being both perfectly merciful and perfectly just. But these two properties seem to contradict each other. To be perfectly just is always to give every person exactly what she deserves. But to be perfectly merciful is to give at least some persons less punishment than they deserve. If so, then a being cannot be perfectly just and perfectly merciful. Thus, if moral perfection entails, as seems reasonable, being perfectly just and merciful, then the concept of moral perfection is inconsistent.

The problem of divine foreknowledge can also be seen as denying that omniscience, omnipotence, and moral perfection constitute a coherent set. Roughly put, the problem of divine foreknowledge is as follows. If God is omniscient, then God knows what every person will do at every moment t. To say that a person p has free will is to say that there is at least one moment t at which p does A but could have done other than A. But if a person p who does A at t has the ability to do other than A at t, then it follows that p has the ability to bring it about that an omniscient God has a false belief - and this is clearly impossible.

On this line of analysis, then, it follows that it is logically impossible for a being to simultaneously instantiate omniscience and omnipotence. Omnipotence entails the power to create free beings, but omniscience rules out the possibility that such beings exist. Thus, a being that is omniscient lacks the ability to create free beings and is hence not omnipotent. Conversely, a being that is omnipotent has the power to create free beings and hence does not know what such beings would do if they existed. Thus, the argument concludes that omniscience and omnipotence are logically incompatible. If this is correct, then all versions of the ontological argument fail.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Anselm, St., Anselm's Basic Writings, translated by S.W. Deane, 2nd Ed. (La Salle, IL: Open Court Publishing Co., 1962)
  • Aquinas, Thomas, St., Summa Theologica (1a Q2), "Whether the Existence of God is Self-Evident (Thomas More Publishing, 1981)
  • Barnes, Jonathan, The Ontological Argument (London: MacMillan Publishing Co., 1972)
  • Broad, C.D., Religion, Philosophy and Psychical Research (New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1953)
  • Findlay, J.N., "God's Existence is Necessarily Impossible," from Flew, Antony and MacIntyre, Alasdair, New Essays in Philosophical Theology (New York: MacMillan Publishing Co., 1955)
  • Gale, Richard, On the Nature and Existence of God (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991)
  • Hartshore, Charles, The Logic of Perfection (LaSalle, IL: Open Court, 1962)
  • Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich, Lectures on the History of Philosophy, translated by E.S. Haldane and F.H. Simson (London, Kegan Paul, 1896)
  • Kant, Immanuel, Critique of Pure Reason, translated by J.M.D. Meiklejohn (New York: Colonial Press, 1900)
  • Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm, New Essays Concerning Human Understanding, translated by A.G. Langley (Chicago, IL: Open Court Publishing, 1896).
  • Malcolm, Norman, "Anselm's Ontological Argument," Philosophical Review, vol. 69, no. 1 (1960), 41-62
  • Miller, Ed L., God and Reason, 2nd Ed. (Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice-Hall, Inc., 1995)
  • Pike, Nelson, "Divine Omniscience and Voluntary Action," Philosophical Review, vol. 74 (1965)
  • Plantinga, Alvin, God, Freedom, and Evil (New York: Harper and Row, 1974)
  • Plantinga, Alvin, The Ontological Argument from St. Anselm to Contemporary Philosophers (Garden City, NY: Doubleday, 1965)
  • Pojman, Louis, Philosophy of Religion (London: Mayfield Publishing Co., 2001)
  • Rowe, William, "Modal Versions of the Ontological Argument," in Pojman, Louis (ed.), Philosophy of Religion, 3rd Ed. (Belmont, CA: Wadsworth Publishing Co., 1998)
  • Sennett, James F., "Universe Indexed Properties and the Fate of the Ontological Argument," Religious Studies, vol. 27 (1991), 65-79

Author Information

Kenneth Einar Himma
Seattle Pacific University
U. S. A.

Charles Sanders Peirce: Pragmatism

peircePragmatism is a principle of inquiry and account of meaning first proposed by C. S. Peirce in the 1870s. The crux of Peirce’s pragmatism is that for any statement to be meaningful, it must have practical bearings. Peirce saw the pragmatic account of meaning as a method for clearing up metaphysics and aiding scientific inquiry. This has led many to take Peirce’s early statement of pragmatism as a forerunner of the verificationist account of meaning championed by logical positivists. The early pragmatism of C.S. Peirce developed through the work of James and Dewey in the U. S. A, and F. C. S. Schiller in Great Britain. Peirce, however, remained unhappy with both his early formulations and the developments made by fellow pragmatists. This lead him, in later life, to refine his own earlier account and rename it “pragmaticism” in order to distinguish it from other more “nominalistic” versions.

The most widely known feature of Peirce’s philosophy is his account of pragmatism. Peirce made his first published attempts at formulating pragmatism in the 1870s, and the maxim he developed there is often regarded as a prototype of the verification principle proposed by logical positivists in the early twentieth century. This early body of work on pragmatism influenced William James who, some twenty years later, publicly declared for the doctrine, named Peirce as its originator, and made the theory common philosophical knowledge. Both Peirce and James took pragmatism to have its roots in older work than Peirce’s late nineteenth century theory. Peirce in particular saw traces of the theory in the work of Kant.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Peirce’s Early Pragmatism
    1. The Purpose of the Maxim
    2. The Maxim and “Hardness”
  3. Peirce’s Later Pragmatism
  4. The Pragmatic Maxim and the Verification Principle
  5. General Problems with The Maxim
  6. Peirce and James: Pragmatism and Pragmaticism
  7. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

The most widely known feature of Peirce’s philosophy is his account of pragmatism. Peirce made his first published attempts at formulating pragmatism in the 1870s, and the maxim he developed there is often regarded as a prototype of the verification principle proposed by logical positivists in the early twentieth century. This early body of work on pragmatism influenced William James who, some twenty years later, publicly declared for the doctrine, named Peirce as its originator, and made the theory common philosophical knowledge. Both Peirce and James took pragmatism to have its roots in older work than Peirce’s late nineteenth century theory. Peirce in particular saw traces of the theory in the work of Kant. However, what Peirce did in the 1870s was to create the first clear formulation of pragmatism as a principle of inquiry and account of meaning.

Peirce returned repeatedly to his early formulations and especially in his later life and worked and re-worked his pragmatic theories, particularly in reaction to the work of William James. Clearly, then, there are two strands to Peirce’s pragmatism: his early statements of the 1870’s and his later work from around the turn of the twentieth century.

2. Peirce’s Early Pragmatism

The earliest clear statement of Peirce’s pragmatism comes from his 1878 paper “How To Make Our Ideas Clear.” In this paper, Peirce introduces a maxim, or principle, which allows us to achieve the highest grade of clarity about the concepts we use. Peirce introduces this principle, which we shall discuss in detail below as the third grade of clarity, as a development of the rationalist notion of “clear and distinct ideas.” Combining his pragmatic maxim with notions of clarity from Descartes and Leibniz, Peirce identifies three grades of clarity or understanding.

The first grade of clarity about a concept is to have an unreflective grasp of it in everyday experience. For instance, my inclination to keep some part of my body in stable contact with a supported horizontal surface at all times suggests that I have an underlying grasp of gravity. The second grade of clarity is to have, or be capable of providing, a definition of the concept. This definition should also be abstracted from any particular experience, i.e., it should be general. So, my ability to provide a definition of gravity (as, say, a force which attracts objects to a point, like the center of the earth) represents a grade of clarity or understanding over and above my unreflective use of that concept in walking, remaining upright, etc.

For Peirce, these two grades of clarity are only part way to a full understanding of a concept; there is a richer level of clarity. It is at this point that he introduces his own third grade of clarity. Peirce says:

Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then the whole of our conception of those effects is the whole of our conception of the object. (Peirce 1878/1992, p. 132)

On this account, then, to have a full understanding of some concept we must not only be familiar with it in day to day encounters, and be able to offer a definition of it, we must also know what effects to expect from holding that concept to be true.

For instance, a full understanding of the concept of “vinegar” comes from possessing all three grades of clarity about it. If I am able to identify vinegar and use the concept appropriately in my everyday experiences, I display the first grade of clarity about this concept. My ability to define “vinegar” as a diluted form of acetic acid, which is sharp to the taste, displays the second grade of clarity. Finally, from the use of “vinegar” in definitional propositions like “vinegar is diluted acetic acid” and “vinegar is sharp to taste,” I can derive a list of conditional propositions which indicate what to expect from actions upon, and interactions with, this concept. So, for instance, “vinegar is acetic acid” would lead me to form the expectation that “If vinegar is acetic acid, then if I dip litmus paper into it, it will turn red.” Having a list of conditional propositions like this, which express the differences this concept can make to expected experiences, allows me to achieve the highest grade of clarity about that concept. This third and final grade of clarity is the earliest statement of what we now know as the pragmatic maxim; it is the crux of Peirce’s early theory of pragmatism.

It should be clear that Peirce’s pragmatic maxim accords with his scientific inclinations. For Peirce, understanding the practical upshot of our concepts means exploring and experimenting upon the conditional hypotheses that we formulate with them. This not only reflects his broader notion of philosophy as a practical laboratory science, but also informs our conception of Peirce’s pragmatic maxim, as it is expressed in “How to Make Our Ideas Clear,” as an account of meaning. The meaning of a concept is expressed by the list of conditional hypotheses that it generates. Interestingly, this seems to generate an account of meaning with two main elements: use and understanding.

The use element of the pragmatic maxim as an account of meaning is apparent from the meanings of the conditionals generated with the maxim. For instance, the meaning expressed by conditional statements about “vinegar” are not strictly about that concept considered in isolation. Rather, they provide the meaning for propositions containing the concept, such as “vinegar is diluted acetic acid,” or “vinegar is sharp to taste.” These conditional statements concern the practical experimental upshot of these propositions, rather than of the concept abstracted from them. This seems to generate meaning for concepts as they are used in sentences and propositions. It also makes the account of meaning an account of meaning for whole sentences, etc.

The second element of the pragmatic maxim as an account of meaning is understanding. We can see that it is the possibility of our understanding the outcome of taking a hypothesis to be true (in the form of conditional statements) that expresses the meaning of a concept. Since a meaningful statement is one for which we can derive practical and experiential consequences, our understanding, or grasp of those consequences, is our understanding or grasp of the meaning.

a. The Purpose of the Maxim

The pragmatic maxim, then, is the means for achieving the third grade of clarity in our understanding of a concept. The list of conditional statements that we generate for a concept lists the effects and practical outcome that we can expect from this concept if the statements containing it turn out to be true. However, Peirce develops the pragmatic maxim and the clarifying method that it represents with some very particular purpose in mind.

As we have already suggested, Peirce’s main use for the pragmatic maxim is as an account of meaning. Quite simply, this enables Peirce to clearly identify useful and meaningful sentences. For instance, if we do not conceive the object of our conceptions to have any practical bearings, then it clearly does not have meaning. This ability to identify meaningful and meaningless statements allows Peirce to make use of the maxim in two ways.

The first use for the pragmatic maxim is the role it plays in Peirce’s account of Inquiry and the accompanying notions of truth and reality. For Peirce, the attainment of truth comes from taking investigation and inquiry as far as it can go. The beliefs we find ourselves accepting at the limit of inquiry represent the truth. What is more, for Peirce, the only way to take inquiry to its limit is through the adoption of a scientific method. However, some criterion of choice is required in order to find which statements/hypotheses etc. are worth investigating. For Peirce, the pragmatic maxim is just such a criterion. Put in its simplest terms, the pragmatic maxim allows us to see what difference the truth of certain concepts would make to our lives. This knowledge further allows us to decide where the best focus for our scientific investigations and belief-settling inquiry lies. If, of two concepts, our investigating the truth of one over the other is likely to have a greater impact upon our reaching a settled state of opinion, then that is the one we should investigate. The only way we are able to see which of the two concepts is likely to have a greater impact is to use the pragmatic maxim and the final grade of clarity or understanding that it affords us.

Peirce’s second use for the pragmatic maxim is to identify those propositions of metaphysics that turn out to be meaningless. For Peirce, the pragmatic maxim enables us to steer clear of metaphysical distractions. The bulk of “ontological metaphysics,” by which Peirce means metaphysics conducted by a priori reasoning alone, has no practical bearing and so will make no contribution to the final fixed state of beliefs. This renders them meaningless. It is this use of the pragmatic maxim as a filter against empty metaphysical statements that ultimately leads to a comparison between Peirce’s maxim and the verification principles of the logical positivists. We will look at the similarities between Peirce’s pragmatic maxim and verificationist accounts of meaning in due course, but for the time being, it is worth noting that both Peirce and the logical positivists see the possibility of ruling out much of metaphysics on the grounds that it has no experiential consequences.

b. The Maxim and “Hardness”

Very quickly, Peirce began to feel that there were difficulties with this early account of the pragmatic maxim. In “How to Make Our Ideas Clear,” Peirce used the concept of “hardness” to illustrate the usefulness of his pragmatic maxim. This lead him to the conditional statement that “If something is hard, it will not be scratched by many other things” as an example, amongst many, of the practical upshot of taking our concept of “hardness” to be true. However, Peirce goes on to raise the question: what do we say about the hardness of a diamond, destroyed before we are able to test it for that quality?

In response, Peirce says that it would not be false to say that the diamond in question was soft. He states that, “there is absolutely no difference between a hard and a soft thing so long as they are not brought to the test” (Peirce 1992-94, vol. II, p. 131). Peirce’s unwillingness to say that the diamond is hard is, in part, a consequence of the way he ties his pragmatic maxim to his account of inquiry. Since any belief that we form about this particular diamond will fail to meet with recalcitrant evidence (there is no longer a diamond to conduct tests upon and so no possibility of confirming or dis-confirming the statement about the hardness of the diamond) we can form any belief we like about its hardness; it is largely a matter of “verbal disagreement.”

Peirce was to return to this issue in his second major period of work on pragmatism with some regret about this counterintuitive feature of his early pragmatic maxim.

3. Peirce’s Later Pragmatism

After his statement of pragmatism in the 1870’s, Peirce did not fully return to it for around twenty years. Peirce had toyed, throughout the 1890’s, with his ideas on the pragmatic maxim but it was not until James’ California Union Address in 1898 that he felt spurred on to a second major effort at formulating his pragmatism. James publicly named the doctrine of pragmatism and identified Peirce as its founder. Famously, James misremembered seeing the term “pragmatism” in Peirce’s “How to Make Our Ideas Clear”. James was, however, correct in identifying this paper as the first source of pragmatism in Peirce’s work. It was from here that James and other pragmatists, like Schiller, took Peirce’s pragmatic maxim and moved it in new directions.

By the turn of the twentieth century, then, Peirce’s need to re-engage with pragmatism was paramount. First of all, it would provide him an opportunity to use James’ acknowledgment of his work to gain a toehold in the philosophical and academic arena. Also, on a less personal level, Peirce did not wholly approve of the directions in which James and Schiller were taking pragmatism. This led him to rename his own brand of pragmatism “pragmaticism,” claiming that this title was “ugly enough to be safe from kidnappers.” Throughout the first decade of the 1900’s, then, Peirce attempted, in Harvard lectures and a series of articles for The Monist, to develop the theory he had first detailed in the 1870’s.

The most notable difference between Peirce’s later accounts of pragmatism and his earlier approach is his attitude to the question of whether the destroyed diamond was hard. This had a profound affect on the way he formulated the conditional propositions that constitute the pragmatic meaning of a concept, as we shall see. Recall that in his account of the 1870’s, Peirce maintained that since the diamond was not tested, it made no difference if we said that it was hard or soft. In his later formulations of pragmatism, Peirce states that we can definitely know that the destroyed diamond was hard.

The underlying cause of this change of heart is Peirce’s adoption of a more sophisticated approach to the reality of modal notions like necessity and possibility. In the 1870’s, Peirce’s account of possibility and necessity are based on the epistemological facts about believers in relation to some statement containing modal terms. For instance, to say that something is necessary is just to say that we know it must be the case. And to say that something is possible is just to say that we do not know it not to be the case. This reduces the reality of modal notions to facts about speakers and the words they use. In his later work, Peirce took this account and his early attitude to the diamond example to be crass “nominalism” on his part: he had failed to be a realist about possibilities, or “would-bes,” as he called them.

Peirce’s use of “nominalism” requires some explanation. Nominalism is more normally associated with the medieval discussion on the existence of universals. The nominalist position in this debate sought to explain universals in terms of properties of the words or names used (hence “nominalism” from nominalis or belonging to the name) rather than as separately existing forms. Peirce, however, uses “nominalism” to refer to any theory that does not take the real separate existence of laws, generalities, possibilities etc. seriously. His earlier explanation of possibilities or “would-bes” in terms of properties of knowers, then, counts, for him, as “nominalism.” As such, Peirce’s adoption of a realist position on possibility, that is a commitment to possibilities or “would-bes” as independently real, around 1896/97 provided the foundation for a significant change in his pragmatism.

In his later account of pragmatism, Peirce takes subjunctive conditionals, rather than indicative conditionals, to form the list of conditional propositions that constitute the meaning of our concepts. For instance, on the 1878 account, conditional statements generated for propositions like “vinegar is diluted acetic acid” would include, “If litmus paper is dipped into it then it will turn that paper red.” This is an indicative conditional, expressing what will happen. On this account, it does not make sense to say that a diamond will resist abrasive substances if the diamond is destroyed before testing can take place. Peirce’s later formulation, though, offers us conditionals like, “If we were to dip litmus paper into it then that paper would turn red,” for propositions like “vinegar is diluted acetic acid.” This subjunctive formulation, with regards the diamond example, sees statements like “this diamond is hard” generating a list of subjunctive conditionals like “If we were to rub this diamond with most materials then it would not be scratched.” Conditionals like this hold whether we test the diamond for hardness or not. Consequently, Peirce’s later pragmatism formulates the pragmatic meaning of concepts (or statements) in terms of subjunctive conditionals; his earlier account uses indicative conditionals.

A further development in Peirce’s later expression of pragmatism is the extent to which he places the pragmatic maxim within his wider philosophical account. In the 1870’s, Peirce’s pragmatic maxim is a part of his account of inquiry, suggesting and clarifying concepts worthy of exploration. By the turn of the twentieth century, Peirce’s architectonic vision of philosophy was in full construction and the concept of inquiry was part of a much broader structure. Consequently, Peirce sought to find an alternative expression of his pragmatic maxim more sensitive to the position of inquiry within his architectonic schema. Inquiry was now firmly realized as a part of logic (broadly conceived as semiotic), and more importantly, as one of the normative sciences in Peirce’s architectonic classification. Further, logic was to form the basis of a scientific metaphysics. Peirce’s later pragmatism, then, needed to move away from the more “nominalistic” emphasis of his earlier account, which made meaning a matter of actual descriptive accounts of practical experiences and effects. The strongly descriptive formulation of pragmatic meaning from the 1870’s ran counter to Peirce’s later prescriptivist view of inquiry as the self-controlled, scientific pursuit of concrete reasonableness. This further explains Peirce’s adoption of subjunctive conditionals: they are more sensitive to the prescriptivism of inquiry as a part of the architectonic.

Peirce also needed an account of pragmatism more sympathetic to his metaphysics. By the turn of the century, Peirce had come to realize fully the role of metaphysics in his system, and rather than dispose of it as empty theorizing, Peirce felt the need to reconstruct it as a meaningful science. His early account of the pragmatic maxim was strongly empirical and in “How To Make Our Ideas Clear,” Peirce defines “practical effects” as “sensible effects” (Peirce 1992-94, vol. I, p. 132), or “effects [...] upon our senses” (ibid., p. 131). This tying of the meaningful to the observable needs careful statement if it is not to rule out all but the immediate experiences of our senses. Peirce’s earliest characterization runs close to this. However, his later accounts attempt to broaden the notion of experience beyond the directly observable in an attempt to avoid rendering all metaphysics empty.

Peirce draws a distinction between “real” and “ideal” experience. The former is what we would normally think of as experience through the senses. The later involves diagrammatic reasoning, employed by mathematicians for instance. For Peirce, “ideal” experience involves performing transformations and operations upon diagrams, and “experiencing,” or observing, the result. Algebraic equations and the transformations we perform upon them, for instance, count as diagrammatic or “ideal” experiences. Since “ideal” reasoning is, in many ways, just mathematical and deductive experience, we might take Peirce to be doing little more than pre-empting the logical positivist’s allowance of analytic statements as valid sentences; he simply draws the distinction between the empirically observable and the analytic in a different way. However, Peirce is doing more than this.

Peirce’s mature philosophy is infused with his realism about possibility and generality. Both are important for his scientific metaphysics. What he needs is some way of explaining our experience of these things. The ability to reason, deduce, and infer allows us to use laws and habits and identify possible outcomes and, at the same time, take them seriously as real generalities and possibilities. This has an interesting effect on Peirce’s later notion of the pragmatic maxim. By 1903 and the Harvard Lectures on Pragmatism, the notion of practical effects from the earlier formulation had developed. Peirce, now sensitive to his own modal realism and more sophisticated metaphysical requirements, took the pragmatic maxim to “allow any flight of imagination provided this imagination ultimately alights upon a possible practical effect” (Peirce 1992-94, vol. II, p. 235).

4. The Pragmatic Maxim and the Verification Principle

Peirce’s pragmatic maxim is often compared with the logical positivist’s verification principle of meaning. With a clearer grasp of the pragmatic maxim, particularly in its later, more mature incarnation, it is worth commenting upon this comparison.

There are, indeed, certain similarities between the pragmatic maxim and the verification principle. For instance, the verification principle takes a sentence to be meaningful if there exists an experience that confirms or disconfirms it. As such, it shares with the pragmatic maxim an experiential or practical criterion of meaning; for both, a proposition must have some observable effect in the world to be meaningful. Also of interest, is that both purposefully use their criterion of meaning (through experiential effects) to identify “meaningless” statements. For both, a hypothesis with no observable or practical effects is without meaning. What is more, both use this ability to identify meaningless statements to reassess the content of metaphysics and demarcate worthwhile philosophy from areas where no real contribution can be made. For instance, Peirce thinks that his pragmatic philosophy can make no real contribution to areas of practical ethics: Logical positivists either class ethics with metaphysics as disposable, or make it a matter of opinion.

However, once we are aware of how Peirce’s account of pragmatism began to develop, the similarities between the maxim and the verification principle begin to get a little strained. Furthermore, some of the marked differences between the verification principle and all of Peirce’s formulations of the maxim become more prominent. First, although both share a desire to reassess metaphysics, the verificationists wish to render it obsolete; this was never an objective for Peirce. For Peirce, the reassessment of metaphysics involves bestowing upon it a scientific respectability and, although this objective is clearer in his later work, he always intended to retain some form of metaphysical philosophy.

The other crucial difference between the pragmatic maxim and the verification principle is the notion of experience. For verificationists, a verifiable experience is a directly observable one, i.e. observable in terms of simple sensory experience. Peirce, on the other hand, particularly with his later formulations of the maxim, has a broader concept of experience. As we have seen, Peirce’s modal realism, or commitment to the reality of “would-bes” characterizes his later accounts. This marks a crucial difference between the two and logical positivist like Carnap would no doubt feel uncomfortable with Peirce’s claims here. Peirce would no doubt think that the logical positivists were too “nominalistic.” Clearly then, Peirce’s pragmatic maxim is not simply a forerunner to the verification principle.

5. General Problems with The Maxim

Although there are clear differences between the pragmatic maxim and the verification principle, they are similar enough for Peirce to face some of the same difficulties encountered by Logical Positivists. A general difficulty for the verification principle is how to formulate it in a way that ensures the right kind of sentences count as meaningful. Traditional criticisms of the verification principle include the thought that in some of its formulations, it is too austere. Sentences about the past, unobservable entities like quarks, etc. are meaningless since there are no directly observable experiences that can confirm them. Peirce felt that this austerity towards meaning was an upshot of his early formulations of the pragmatic maxim, ruling out all metaphysics, including the kind that he felt might be respectable enough to count as meaningful. This led to the more generous construal of experience in his later formulations.

However, whether or not Peirce’s later formulations in terms of “possible practical effects” allow too much to count as meaningful is open to debate. For instance, because the formulation of the maxim in terms of possible practical effects, rather than actual or realized effects, seems to shift the focus of the maxim to expectations rather than actions, the body of meaningful sentences arguably becomes too inclusive. If we can show that some hypothesis or statement has some possible practical effect, then the Christian expectation of the second coming of Christ, say, and the avoidance of sin that it results in, seems to count towards the pragmatic meaning of “God is real.” Although Peirce does actually attempt to argue for the existence of God along similar lines, suggesting that “God is real” has the possible practical effect of seeing man’s “self-controlled conduct” increase (Peirce 1992-94, vol. II, p. 446), it is not clear that this development of the maxim is entirely healthy. The use of the pragmatic maxim in Peirce’s later work appears to take on metaphysical baggage that had previously been disposed of, allowing what counts as meaningful to run out of control. It seems, then, that the pragmatic maxim, in all of its formulations, struggles to steer a course between the austerity of the early pragmatism, and the laxity of the later more metaphysically tolerant formulations.

One final peculiarity of the pragmatic maxim, in both its early and late formulations, is that all propositions ultimately become future referring. This is fine with most hypotheses like “diamonds are hard” or “vinegar is diluted acetic acid,” since it is their contribution, possible or otherwise, to future experience that matters. However, statements or hypotheses about the past, rather oddly, become focused on their future effects. So, the pragmatic meaning of “John F. Kennedy was assassinated” generates conditionals about our future investigations, checking history books, reading the Warren report, watching TV footage, and asking those who knew him, etc. This feels counterintuitive, since the statement in question, “John F. Kennedy was assassinated,” seems to be about what happened to J.F.K., rather than about our experiences in unearthing support for its truth.

Despite this rather counterintuitive generation of future referring conditionals for hypotheses about the past, it is not clear that it does a great deal of damage to Peirce’s pragmatism. Rather, it is just a quirk of the maxim’s expression of meaning in terms of action or expectations.

6. Peirce and James: Pragmatism and Pragmaticism

One truly interesting issue for Peirce’s pragmatism is the relationship it bears to the work of the pragmatic philosophers that followed him. Peirce’s pragmatism influenced William James, John Dewey, Josiah Royce and F.C.S Schiller to name but a few of his American and British contemporaries. However, the influence upon and contrast with the work of William James is perhaps the most interesting. This is because although Peirce’s maxim and his work in the 1870’s provide the foundation for many early pragmatists, it is James that popularized the pragmatist approach to philosophy and James’ pragmatism that looms large in our common philosophical understanding of the doctrine. Also, because of the role of James as popularizer, it is his development that prompted much of Peirce’s later reevaluation of his own theory. In order to see what is unique and interesting in Peirce’s pragmaticism, then, it is worth emphasizing some of the crucial differences between Peirce and James’ take on pragmatism.

The primary difference between Peirce and James is that the pragmatic maxim in Peirce’s work is a theory of meaning, but in the hands of James, it becomes a theory of truth. This, however, is due to more crucial differences between the two that mean James’ notion of pragmatism far outstretches a simple meaning criterion, and reflects his more fundamental thoughts about philosophy in general. This comes most prominently to the fore in their basic ideas about the place of pragmatism in philosophy as a whole.

Firstly, Peirce and James have different ideas about the philosophical uses to which a pragmatic method should be put. James is famously anti-intellectualist in his philosophy, distrusting the extent to which we can answer all the important human questions with a materialistic and scientific approach to understanding the universe and our place in it. Peirce, on the other hand, particular in his later work, sees the whole of philosophy embedded within a scientific system and the pragmatic maxim centrally embedded in philosophy. The consequence is that James tends to see pragmatism, and his philosophy, as the stepping off point where materialist and purely intellectualist sciences fail to answer our questions about which beliefs are justifiable. Religious and moral questions require a separate criterion of justification, and this is where a pragmatic method determines what difference I take some such belief to have, and why it is reasonable to hold that belief.

For Peirce, philosophy in general, and the pragmatic maxim in particular, should never stray this far from scientific inquiry. The important philosophical questions, and those with which the pragmatic maxim are concerned, remain firmly within the realm of scientific and intellectualist inquiry. As far as Peirce is concerned, the questions to which James is inclined to apply a pragmatic method are largely beyond the realm of fruitful philosophical inquiry. For Peirce pragmatism is strictly within the realms of scientific sensibilities: for James, it begins at the point where our scientific explanations fall short.

These two different outlooks on philosophy and pragmatism underwrite two very different attitudes to the usefulness of pragmatism entirely. Peirce sees pragmatism as a logical principle. The maxim is a tool of analysis designed to make our concepts clear and logically precise. For James, pragmatism is a philosophical outlook. For him, pragmatism is an approach to philosophy that looks towards the consequences of belief, which looks at human action, and moves the whole enterprise of understanding them, away from scientifically founded philosophy. These two different attitudes result in some further interesting features of the two philosophies.

Firstly, James’ pragmatism, in many ways, looks like a total break with traditionalist concerns. For James, pragmatism makes a move away from the philosophies of Kant and Hegel, with their emphasis upon first principles, categories etc. Indeed, the neo-pragmatism of Richard Rorty takes James’ work to be the decisive shift from traditional philosophy to modern concerns. Of course, Peirce’s philosophy retains the architectonic approach with first principles and categories and looks traditionalist as a result. In many ways, it is these features of Peirce’s work that leaves Rorty unconvinced by Peirce’s status as a pragmatist philosopher.

In another respect though, it is James that looks to have remained within the traditionalist mold and Peirce’s pragmatism that looks progressive. James’ particular take on pragmatism looks towards the individual and the effects of belief upon some person or another. Peirce’s pragmatism on the other hand, looks towards experience in general and effects across persons. For Peirce, the establishment of habit across persons and communities is what is interesting about “practical upshots,” not individual action and reaction. The contrast between James’ individualist approach and Peirce’s communalism is interesting. Individualism is characteristic of much of traditional philosophy, particularly since Descartes, and in this respect, James retains much of the baggage of traditional philosophy. Peirce’s communalism, though, has a particular resonance with contemporary attitudes, particularly since the later Wittgenstein.

One final difference in the pragmatisms of Peirce and James, then, are their different attitudes to the reality of modal notions like possibility and necessity. James saw pragmatism as fundamentally “nominalistic.” As such, the reality of possibilities and so on is explained in James’ philosophy in a way similar to that of the early Peirce, i.e. subjective and epistemological. Peirce’s own mature take on modal notions, as we know, is to be a realist about “would-bes.” This makes his pragmatism focus less on actual occurrences and more on potential effects. It also has the further effect of making his pragmatism take the idea of laws and long run habit more seriously; the idea of natural law concerning the “hardness” of diamonds is, after all, part of his explanation of why the destroyed diamond can count as hard.

7. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Peirce, C.S. 1931-58. The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, eds. C. Hartshorne, P. Weiss (Vols. 1-6) and A. Burks (Vols. 7-8). (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press).
    • The first wide spread presentation of Peirce’s work both published and unpublished; its topical arrangement makes it misleading but it is still the first source for most people.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1982 —. The Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition, eds. M. Fisch, C. Kloesel, E. Moore, N. Houser et al., (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • The ongoing vision of the late Max Fisch and colleagues to produce an extensive presentation of Peirce’s views on a par with The Collected Papers, but without its idiosyncrasies. Currently published in eight volumes (of thirty) up to 1884, it is rapidly superseding its predecessor.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1992-94. The Essential Peirce, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Vol. 1) and the Peirce Edition Project (Vol. 2), (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press).
    • A crucial two volume reader of the cornerstone works of Peirce’s writings. Equally important are the introductory commentaries by Nathan Houser.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1878/1992. “How To Make Our Ideas Clear.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.1, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), pp. 124-141.
    • Peirce’s first statement of pragmatism and the source to which James refers as the seminary of his own pragmatism.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1903/1998. “Harvard Lectures on Pragmatism.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.2., ed. The Peirce Edition Project. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), chs. 10-16.
    • Often difficult later statement of Peirce’s pragmatism. It is here that Peirce tries to expound his own mature views on pragmatism as part of an architectonically embedded logic, dependent upon ethics and aesthetics.
  • Peirce, C.S. 1905/1998. “What Pragmatism Is.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.2., ed. The Peirce Edition Project. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), pp. 331-345.
    • One of Peirce’s late Monist articles on pragmatism where he publicly distinguishes his “pragmaticism” from the pragmatism of James. The rest of the Monist series, and other work on his “pragmaticism” are reproduced in The Essential Peirce, Vol.2 and are worth looking at.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Gruender, D. 1983. “Pragmatism, Science and Metaphysics.” In The Relevance of Charles Peirce, ed. Eugene Freeman. (La Salle, IL: Monist Library of Philosophy), pp. 271-291.
    • Expands the often-made comparison between Peirce’s pragmatic maxim and the verification principle by comparing Peirce’s and Carnap’s accounts of meaning and science.
  • Hookway, C.J. 1997. “Logical Principles and Philosophical Attitudes: Peirce’s Response to James’ Pragmatism.” In The Cambridge Companion to William James, ed. Ruth Anna Putnam. (New York: Cambridge University Press), pp. 145-165.
    • Interesting, useful and detailed comparison of the work of James and Peirce, emphasizing their different motivations in using pragmatism, with particular emphasis on Peirce’s own understanding of James’ work.
  • Hookway, C.J. 2000. “Avoiding Circularity and Proving Pragmatism.” In Truth, Rationality, and Pragmatism. (Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 285-303.
    • A discussion that takes Peirce’s later concerns with the logical status of pragmatism further than we have done here. Hookway details Peirce’s late concern with attempting to “prove” his own pragmatic maxim by discussing the structure that such a proof should take.
  • Houser, N. 1998. “Introduction to The Essential Peirce Vol. 2.” In The Essential Peirce, Vol.2, ed. The Peirce Edition Project. (Bloomington IN: Indiana University Press), pp. xvii-xxxviii.
    • Houser’s introduction and discussion of the papers included in The Essential Peirce Vol. 2, offers a detailed look at the development of Peirce later thoughts on pragmatism. Further, a discussion of Peirce’s efforts to a find a “proof” for his maxim provides useful insight into Peirce’s pragmatism.
  • Misak, C., 1991. Truth and the End of Inquiry. (Oxford: Oxford University Press)
    • In chapter one of this book, Misak discusses the pragmatic maxim at length and investigates its different formulations from early to late, assessing their shortcomings. Of particular interest, is her insistence on the importance of pragmatism to Peirce’s account of truth.

Author Information

Albert Atkin
University of Sheffield
United Kingdom

Pascal's Wager about God

Pascal-imgBlaise Pascal (1623-1662) offers a pragmatic reason for believing in God: even under the assumption that God’s existence is unlikely, the potential benefits of believing are so vast as to make betting on theism rational. The super-dominance form of the argument conveys the basic Pascalian idea, the expectations argument refines it, and the dominating expectations argument gives a more sophisticated version still.

Critics in turn have raised a number of now-classic challenges. (i) According to intellectualism, deliberately choosing which beliefs to hold is practically impossible. Intellectualism, however, appears to be not only questionable but irrelevant. (ii) According to the many-gods objection, Pascal’s wager begs the question and hence is irrational. It assumes that if God exists then God must take a rather specific form, which few open-minded agnostics would accept. Pascalians reply by invoking the notion of a genuine option (which is not defined), by devising run-off decision theory (which is not justified), by claiming that Pascal was understandably unaware of other cultures (which is not true), and by appealing to generic theism (which does not solve the problem).

(iii) According to evidentialism, Pascalian reasoning is epistemically irresponsible and hence immoral. One development of this argument, suggesting that God is an evidentialist, amounts to a variant of the many-gods objection. Another development, suggesting that we should be evidentialists, hinges on the outcome of larger moral theory. (iv) According to various paradoxes, reference to infinite values is decision-theoretic non-sense.

Table of Contents

  1. A Reason for Believing in God
    1. The Super-Dominance Argument
    2. The Expectations Argument
    3. The Dominating Expectations Argument
  2. The Intellectualist Objection: Is Belief a Matter of Choice?
  3. The Many-Gods Objection: Do Rival Religious Options Undermine Each Other?
    1. Genuine Options
    2. Run-off Decision Theory
    3. Relativism
    4. Generic Theism
  4. The Evidentialist Objection: Is Prudential Reasoning Ethical?
  5. The Paradox Objection: Is Decision Theory Coherent?
    1. The Equi-utility Paradox
    2. The St. Petersburg Paradox
  6. References and Further Reading

1. A Reason for Believing in God

There are two kinds of argument for theism. Traditional, epistemic arguments hold that God exists; examples include arguments from cosmology, design, ontology, and experience. Modern, pragmatic arguments hold that, regardless of whether God exists, believing in God is good for us, or is the right thing to do; examples include William James's will to believe and Blaise Pascal's wager.

Pascal -- French philosopher, scientist, mathematician and probability theorist (1623-1662) -- argues that if we do not know whether God exists then we should play it safe rather than risk being sorry. The argument comes in three versions (Hacking 1972), all of them employing decision theory.

For those who are unfamiliar with decision theory, the idea can be illustrated by considering a lottery. Suppose there are 100 tickets at $1 each and a jackpot of $1000. Is it rational to play? If you total the earnings and the expenses for all the tickets ($1000 - $100), then divide by the number of tickets, you find that on average each ticket nets $9. In comparison, not playing involves zero expense and zero payoff. Since $9 is preferable to $0, it is rational to play. Alternately, suppose there are 1000 tickets costing $2 each, a grand prize of $1000, and a consolation prize of $500. Then the total earnings and expenses ($1500 - $2000), divided by the number of tickets, yields a net loss of fifty cents for the average ticket. In this case, unless you have some reason to believe that a given ticket is not average, playing the game is irrational.

To put the matter more generally: a given action (say, buying a ticket) is associated with a set of possible outcomes (say, winning the grand prize, winning the consolation prize, or losing); each outcome has a certain value or "utility" (the utility of winning might be the value of the prize minus the cost of the ticket); the "expectation" for each outcome is equal to its utility multiplied by the probability of its happening; the expectation for a given action is the sum of the expectations for each possible associated outcome. The course of action having the maximum expectation is the rational one to follow.

a. The Super-Dominance Argument

Pascal begins with a two-by-two matrix: either God exists or does not, and either you believe or do not.

--Table I-- God exists God does not exist
You believe in God (a) infinite reward (c) 250 utiles
You do not believe in God (b) infinite punishment (d) 200 utiles

If God exists then theists will enjoy eternal bliss (cell a), while atheists will suffer eternal damnation (cell b). If God does not exist then theists will enjoy finite happiness before they die (say 250 units worth), and atheists will enjoy finite happiness too, though not so much because they will experience angst rather than the comforts of religion. Regardless of whether God exists, then, theists have it better than atheists; hence belief in God is the most rational belief to have.

b. The Expectations Argument

What if the atheist is a happy hedonist, or if the theist is a miserable puritan? In that case the value of cell (d) is greater than that of (c), and the dominance argument no longer works. However, if there is a 50-50 chance that God exists then we can calculate the expectations as follows:

--Table II-- God exists God does not exist
You believe in God +infinity something finite
You do not believe in God -infinity something finite

Using the table, the expectation for believing in God = (positive infinity x ½) + (a finite value x ½) = positive infinity; and the expectation for not believing = (negative infinity x ½) + (a finite value x ½) = negative infinity. Hence it is rational to believe in God.

c. The Dominating Expectations Argument

It’s unlikely that the probability of God’s existing is exactly one-half, but this does not matter. Due to the infinite value in cell (a), if God’s existence has any finite probability then the expectation for believing in God will be infinite. Furthermore, this infinity will swamp the values in cells (b), (c), and (d), so long as (c) is not infinitely negative and neither (b) nor (d) is infinitely positive.

2. The Intellectualist Objection: Is Belief a Matter of Choice?

According to doxastic voluntarism, believing and disbelieving are choices that are up to us to make. Intellectualists deny this; they say it is impossible to adopt a belief simply because we decide to. If I offered to pay you $1000 for believing the sky is green, for instance, could you sincerely adopt this belief simply by wishing to? Evidently not. Therefore, some say, Pascal's wager does not give legitimate grounds for believing in God.

But although we cannot adopt a belief simply by deciding to, the same is true for other actions. For instance, we cannot go to school simply by deciding to; rather, we have to wake up by a certain time (which may mean first developing a certain kind of habit), we must get dressed, we must put one foot in front of another, and so forth. Then if we are lucky we will end up at our destination, though this is far from guaranteed. So it goes for any other endeavor in life: one chooses to become a doctor, or to marry by age 30, or to live in the tropics -- the attainment of such goals can be facilitated, though not purely willed, by appropriate micro-steps that are more nearly under voluntary control. Indeed, even twitching your little finger is not entirely a matter of volition, as its success depends on a functioning neural system running from your brain, through your spine, and down your arm. Your minutest action is a joint product of internal volition and external contingencies. The same applies to theistic belief: although you cannot simply decide to be a theist, you can choose to read one-sided literature, you can choose to join a highly religious community, you can try to induce mystical experiences by ingesting psychedelic drugs like LSD, and you can choose to chant and pray. No mere exercise of will can guarantee that you will end up believing in God, but neither can any exercise of will guarantee that you succeed in doing anything else you decide to do. If there is a difference between our ability to voluntarily believe something and our ability to voluntarily wiggle our toe, it is a difference in degree of likely success, and not a difference in logical kind.

Yet a difference in degree may be significant, and it is worth noting that theists and atheists may disagree on the power of prayer to change one’s beliefs. Theists generally think that prayer tends to bring one into contact with God, in which case one is likely to notice, recognize, and believe in God’s existence. Atheists, on the other hand, have no particular reason to think that mere praying should notably effect conversion. An agnostic would do well then to try; for it would be precisely in the case where success matters that trying is likely to be most efficacious.

Indeed, it might not matter whether we can choose to have the beliefs we have. If Tables I or II be right then the fact would remain that it is pragmatically better to believe in God than not, insofar as theists, taken across all possible worlds, are on average better off than atheists. It does not matter whether theism results from personal will-power, God's grace, or cosmic luck -- regardless, being better off is being better off. Thus, Pascal’s wager need not succeed as a tool of persuasion for it to serve as a tool of assessment (Mougin & Sober 1994).

3. The Many-Gods Objection: Do Rival Religious Options Undermine Each Other?

Pascal's compatriot Denis Diderot replied to the wager that an ayatollah or "imam could just as well reason the same way." His point is that decision theory cannot decide among the various religions practiced in the world; it gives no warrant for believing in Pascal's Catholicism, or even in a generic Judeo-Christianity. The reason is that Tables I and II beg the question in favor of a certain kind of theism; a more complete matrix must consider at least the following possibilities.

--Table III-- Yahweh exists Allah exists
You worship Yahweh infinite reward infinite punishment
You worship Allah infinite punishment infinite reward

In reply, Pascalians offer a number of defenses.

a. Genuine Options

Some Pascalians insist that only certain theological possibilities count as "genuine options" (James 1897, Jordan 1994b), although this notion is never clearly defined. Perhaps a proposition P is a genuine option for some subject S only if S is likely to succeed in believing P, should S choose to. However, the relevance of volition is questionable, as discussed in the previous section. Alternatively, perhaps P is a genuine option for S unless P strikes S as "bizarre" or untraditional (Jordan 1994b). The difficulty here lies in distinguishing this position from emotional prejudice (Saka 2001). Finally, it may be that a genuine option is one that possesses sufficient evidential support, in which case it can then participate in a run-off decision procedure.

b. Run-off Decision Theory

Some Pascalians propose combining pragmatic and epistemic factors in a two-stage process. First, one uses epistemic considerations in selecting a limited set of belief options, then one uses prudential considerations in choosing among them (Jordan 1994b). Alternatively, one first uses prudential considerations to choose religion over non-religion, and then uses epistemic considerations to choose a particular religion (Schlesinger 1994, Jordan 1993).

In order to be at all plausible, this approach must answer two questions. First, what is the justification for deliberately excluding some possibilities, no matter how improbable, from prudential reasoning? It seems irrational to dismiss some options that are acknowledged to be possible, even be they unlikely, so long as the stakes are sufficiently high (Sorensen 1994). Second, can epistemic considerations work without begging the question? Schlesinger argues that the Principle of Sufficient Reason gives some support for believing in God, but in a Pascalian context this is questionable. If you subscribe to a suitable form of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (one that leads to a given kind of theism), you are likely to be a theist already and hence Pascal’s wager does not apply to you; on the other hand, if you do not believe in the right kind of Principle of Sufficient Reason, then you will not think that it makes theism more probable than atheistic Buddhism, or anthropomorphic theism more probable than deism. Other epistemic considerations, such as Schlesinger’s appeal to testimony, simplicity, and sublimity, meet with analogous challenges (Amico 1994, Saka 2001).

c. Relativism

Some Pascalians, while acknowledging that the Wager might be unsound for today’s multi-culturally sophisticated audience, maintain that the Wager is sound relative to Pascal and his peers in the 1600s, when Catholicism and agnosticism were the only possibilities (Rescher 1985, Franklin 1998). But the Crusades in the 1100s taught the French of Islam, the Renaissance in the 1400s taught the French of Greco-Roman paganism, the discoveries of the 1500s taught the French of new-world paganism, and several wars of religion taught the French of Protestantism. To claim that the educated French of the 1600s rightfully rejected alien beliefs without consideration appears to endorse rank prejudice.

d. Generic Theism

Some acknowledge that Pascal's wager cannot decide among religions, yet maintain that "it at least gets us to theism" (Jordan 1994b, Armour-Garb 1999). The idea is that Catholics, Protestants, Jews, Moslems, and devil-worshippers can all legitimately use decision theory to conclude that it is best to believe in some supreme being. Against this there are two objections. First, it disregards theological possibilities such as the Professor's God. The Professor's God rewards those who humbly remain skeptical in the absence of evidence, and punishes those who adopt theism on the basis of self-interest (Martin 1975, 1990; Mackie 1982). Second, the claim that Pascal’s wager yields generic theism assumes that all religions are theistic. But consider the following sort of atheistic Buddhism: if you clear your mind then you will attain nirvana and otherwise you will not -- that is, if you fill your mind with thoughts and desires, such as believing that God exists or living God, then you will not attain salvation (Saka 2001).

4. The Evidentialist Objection: Is Prudential Reasoning Ethical

There are two versions of this objection that need to be kept distinct. The first one suggests that Pascalian reasoners are manipulative egoists whom God might take exception to, and they won’t be rewarded after all (Nicholl 1978). Schlesinger 1994 responds by saying that any reasoning that gets us to believe in God, if God exists, cannot be bad. But this argument seems to depend on the nature of God. If God holds that results are all that matter, that the ends justify the means, then Schlesinger is right. But maybe God holds that true beliefs count as meritorious only if they are based on good evidence; maybe God rewards only evidentialists. In short, this form of the objection is just another version of the many-gods objection.

Another form of evidentialism refers not to God's character but to our own. Regardless of how God might or might not reward our decisions, it may be categorically, epistemically or otherwise wrong -- "absolutely wicked", in the words of G.E. Moore -- for us to base any belief on decision-theoretic self-interest (Clifford 1879, Nicholls 1978).

Since utilitarians would tend to favor Pascalian reasoning while Kantians and virtue ethicists would not, the issue at stake belongs to a much larger debate in moral philosophy.

5. The Paradox Objection: Is Decision Theory Coherent?

a. The Equi-utility Paradox

If you regularly brush your teeth, there is some chance you will go to heaven and enjoy infinite bliss. On the other hand, there is some chance you will enjoy infinite heavenly bliss even if you do not brush your teeth. Therefore the expectation of brushing your teeth (infinity plus a little extra due to oral health = infinity) is the same as that of not brushing your teeth (infinity minus a bit due to cavities and gingivitis = infinity), from which it follows that dental hygiene is not a particularly prudent course of action. In fact, as soon as we allow infinite utilities, decision theory tells us that any course of action is as good as any other (Duff 1986). Hence we have a reductio ad absurdum against decision theory, at least when it’s extended to infinite cases. In reply to such difficulties, Jordan 1993 proposes a run-off decision theory as described above.

b. The St. Petersburg Paradox

Imagine tossing a coin until it lands heads-up, and suppose that the payoff grows exponentially according to the number of tosses you make. If the coin lands heads-up on the first toss then the payoff is $2; if it takes two tosses then the payoff is $4; if it takes three tosses then the payoff is $8; and so forth, ad infinitum. Now the odds of the game ending on the first toss is 1/2; of ending on the second toss, 1/4; on the third, 1/8; and so forth. Since there is a one-half chance of winning $2, plus a quarter chance of winning $4, plus a one-eighth chance of winning $8, and so forth, your expectation for playing the game is (1/2 x $2) + (1/4 x $4) + (1/8 x $8) +…, that is, $1 + $1 + $1… = infinity! It follows you should be willing to pay any finite amount for the privilege of playing this game. Yet it clearly seems irrational to pay very much at all. The conclusion is that decision theory is a bad guide when infinite values are involved (for discussion of this very old paradox, see Sorensen 1994). Byl (1994) points out that instead of referring to infinite payoffs we can speak of arbitrarily high ones. No matter how improbable be the existence of God, it is still decision-theoretically rational to believe in God if the reward for doing so is sufficiently, yet only finitely, high. However, this does not address the heart of the problem, for the St. Petersburg paradox too may be cast in terms of an arbitrarily high limit. Intuitively, one would not be willing to pay a million dollars, say, for the privilege of playing a game capped at one-million-and-one coin tosses, and it is not just because of the diminishing value of money. There is something unsettling about decision theory, at least as applied to extreme cases, and so we might be skeptical about using it as a basis for religious commitment.

6. References and Further Reading

The best known defense of Pascal is Lycan & Schlesinger 1989; for responses see Amico 1994 and Saka 2001. A good sourcebook is Jordan 1994a.

  • Amico, Robert (1994) "Pascal’s wager revisited", International Studies in Philosophy 26:1-11.
  • Armour-Garb, Bradley (1999) "Betting on God", Religious Studies 35:119-38.
  • Byl, John (1994) "On Pascal’s wager and infinite utilities", Faith & Philosophy 11:467-73.
  • Clifford, William (1879) "The ethics of belief", Lectures & Essays, Macmillan.
  • Duff, Anthony (1986) "Pascal’s wager and infinite utilities", Analysis 46:107-09.
  • Franklin, James (1998) "Two caricatures, I: Pascal’s wager", International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 44:115-19.
  • Hacking, Ian (1972) "The logic of Pascal’s wager", reprinted in Jordan 1994a.
  • James, William (1897) "The will to believe", reprinted in The Will to Believe and Other Essays, Dover.
  • Jordan, Jeff (1991) "The many-gods objection and Pascal’s wager", International Philosophical Quarterly 31:309-17.
  • Jordan, Jeff (1993) "Pascal’s wager and the problem of infinite utilities", Faith & Philosophy 10:49-59.
  • Jordan, Jeff, editor (1994a) Gambling on God, Lanham MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • Jordan, Jeff (1994b) "The many-gods objection", in Jordan 1994a; a restatement of Jordan 1991.
  • Lycan, William & George Schlesinger (1989) "You bet your life", in Reason & Responsibility, 7th edition (ed. Joel Feinberg, Belmont CA: Wadsworth). Also in the 8th, 9th, 10th editions; in Philosophy and the Human Condition, 2d edition (ed. Tom Beauchamp et al., Englewood Cliffs NJ: Prentice Hall, 1989); and in Contemporary Perspectives on Religious Epistemology (ed. Douglas Geivet & Brendan Sweetmar, Oxford, 1993). See also Schlesinger 1994.
  • Mackie, J.L. (1982) The Miracle of Theism, Oxford, pp. 200-03.
  • Martin, Michael (1975) "On four critiques of Pascal’s wager", Sophia 14:1-11.
  • Martin, Michael (1990) Atheism, Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 229-38.
  • Mougin, Gregory & Elliott Sober (1994) "Betting on Pascal’s wager", Nous 28:382-95.
  • Nicholl, Larimore (1978) "Pascal’s Wager: The bet is off", Philosophy & Phenomenological Research 39:274-80.
  • Pascal, Blaise (composed in 1600s, first published in 1800s) Pensees, section 343; translated & reprinted by Penguin and many others.
  • Rescher, Nicholas (1985) Pascal’s Wager, University of Notre Dame Press.
  • Saka, Paul (2001) "Pascal’s wager and the many gods objection", Religious Studies 37:321-41.
  • Schlesinger, George (1994) "A central theistic argument", in Jordan 1994a; a restatement of Lycan & Schlesinger 1989.
  • Sorensen, Roy (1994) "Infinite decision theory", in Jordan 1994a.

See also: Faith and Reason

Author Information

Paul Saka
University of Texas, Pan American
U. S. A.

Moral Epistemology

Can we ever know that it’s wrong to torture innocent children? More generally, can we ever know, or at least have some justification for believing, whether anything is morally right or wrong, just or unjust, virtuous or vicious, noble or base, good or bad? Most of us make moral judgments every day; so most of us would like to think so. But how is such knowledge, or justification, possible? We do not seem to simply perceive moral truth, as we perceive the truth that there is a computer screen before us. We do not seem to simply understand it, as we understand that all roosters are male. And we do not seem to simply feel it, as we feel a bit hungry right now. Moral epistemology explores this problem about knowledge and justification.

First, this article explores the traditional approaches to the problem: foundationalist theories, coherentist theories, and contextualist theories. Then the article explores the non-traditional approaches: reliabilist theories, noncognitivist theories, ideal decision theories, and politicized theories. The article concludes with an introduction to naturalizing moral epistemology and to some relevant issues in metaethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Classifying Theories of Moral Epistemology
  2. Traditional Approaches
    1. Foundationalist Theories
    2. Coherentist Theories
    3. Contextualist Theories
    4. Traditional Skepticism
  3. Non-Traditional Approaches
    1. Reliabilist Theories
    2. Noncognitivist Theories
    3. Ideal Decision Theories
    4. Politicized Theories
  4. Can Moral Epistemology Be Naturalized?
  5. Moral Epistemology & Metaethics
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Classifying Theories of Moral Epistemology

Below we introduce moral epistemology in terms of eight theories of moral epistemology. We divide these in half by distinguishing traditional from non-traditional approaches. By “traditional” we intend something more precise than just “old school.” So we launch our discussion of traditional approaches by defining our sense of “traditional.”

We conclude with two more detailed discussions. First, we introduce a moral epistemic debate of considerable recent importance, the debate about whether moral epistemology can be naturalized (roughly, moved in the direction of becoming scientific). Second, we discuss moral epistemology’s broader context as a subfield of metaethics (roughly, the part of ethical theory that examines the deepest assumptions behind our moral thought); we use this final discussion to introduce the problem of what the objects of moral knowledge could be.

2. Traditional Approaches

Foundationalist theories, coherentist theories, and contextualist theories represent the traditional approaches to moral epistemology. Reliabilist theories, noncognitivist theories, ideal decision theories, and politicized theories represent non-traditional approaches. By an approach to moral epistemology, we mean either (a) an attempt to explain how we can have moral knowledge, or at least justified moral beliefs, or (b) an attempt to argue that we cannot have one or both of these. The former are more or less non-skeptical, and the latter are more or less skeptical, approaches. This allows non-skeptical and skeptical approaches to compromise at the point of saying that we can have some justification for believing, but not knowledge of, some moral truths.

Approaches to moral epistemology are traditional only if they are committed to all of the following five (two moral and three epistemic) assumptions:


  1. [Moral] Cognitivism: we have moral beliefs, and thus moral belief contents that are either true or false (but not both true and false).
  2. [Moral] Realism: there are moral facts that can correspond to what moral claims represent as being the case, such as facts about the goodness or badness of people or the rightness or wrongness of their actions.
  3. [Epistemic] The Necessity of Justified True Belief: If someone knows something, then at the very least one is justified in believing it; and it is true; and one believes it. If one is justified in believing it, then one has a decisively good reason to believe it, a reason that makes one epistemically responsible in believing it.
  4. [Epistemic] Internalism: In order to be justified in believing something and therefore in order to know it, one must have in mind the factors that reasonably ground one's right to believe it. The strongest internalist theories demand that these factors be immediately in mind, whereas the milder internalist theories demand only that they be available upon reflection. This seems to imply that one must possess (without any need for further experience or research) the grounds of good answers to all kinds of skeptics in order to be justified in believing something. However, it perhaps does not imply that one can recognize all of those reasons as such or that one can effectively articulate them.
  5. [Epistemic] The Priority of Epistemic Structure: Theories of justification must also be theories of the structure of justification in response to the regress problem, which is discussed in the section on Traditional Skepticism.

a. Foundationalist Theories

According to foundationalism, all justified beliefs are either foundational or derived. Foundational beliefs or basic beliefs possess noninferential justification; derived beliefs do not. A foundational belief does not owe its justification to logical inference from other justified beliefs. A derived belief gets its justification through inference, either directly or indirectly, from foundational beliefs.

Where can we get noninferential justification for our foundational beliefs? This is one of the most difficult questions for any foundationalist theory. The two most common answers are experience (for instance, sense perception or introspection) and reason (for instance, grasp of the self-evident through understanding). Most foundationalist moral epistemic theories go for one or the other, or some blend, of these two very general answers. The two following sorts of theories are usually conceived in foundationalist terms.

Moral Sense Theories assert the existence of a uniquely moral sense by which we perceive rightness or wrongness. According to early Scottish versions of this theory, such as those of Frances Hutcheson ([1725]) and David Hume ([1740]), the perception in question is reflexive, grounded in a kind of sentiment or feeling, which is secondary to, and attendant upon, perceiving actions or states of affairs with our ordinary senses. Sometimes moral sense theories are described as intuitionist theories; more often “intuitionism” is used only for the following.

Moral Epistemic Intuitionist theories imply that we can non-perceptually recognize some moral truths in a way that can noninferentially justify us in believing them. According to W. D. Ross, who defended perhaps the most influential classical version of the theory, some moral propositions are self-evident, so that merely understanding them produces, at least in the best people, justification for believing them. His main examples are mid-level moral generalizations such as, ‘I have a prima facie duty (an unless-overridden-by-a-stronger-duty, duty) to keep my promises’. Ross’s intuitionism is rationalist: it grounds foundational justification for moral beliefs in a rational grasp of the self-evident ([1930]; 1936). Some intuitionist theories are less obviously rationalist. For instance, A. C. Ewing thought that we have a unique ability to detect “fittingness” in responses to circumstances, which is neither as straightforwardly rationalist as Rossian intuition nor as similar to sense perception as a moral sense theory would require (1949). Most historical moral and epistemic theories imply some form of intuitionism, and even the most radical departures from tradition. For instance, some naturalized moral epistemologies claim strong analogies with intuitionism. Some writers who have recently defended versions of moral epistemic intuitionism are Robert Audi (1997, 2004), Jonathan Dancy (1993), Brad Hooker (2000), and David McNaughton (2000).

b. Coherentist Theories

According to coherentism, all justified beliefs are inferentially justified; there are no foundational beliefs. Instead, what justifies us in holding beliefs are their relations of mutual support, that is, their coherence. Justification therefore accrues to beliefs only in virtue of their membership in coherent sets, and so cannot be assessed when beliefs are evaluated singly. Coherence itself is usually taken to be, at a minimum, logical consistency. Many coherentists argue that it requires not only logical consistency, but also explanatory potency or predictive value, similar to what good scientific theories exhibit.

The most important conception of coherence in recent moral epistemology is called reflective equilibrium. John Rawls is largely responsible for the contemporary importance of this conception. He proposed it in the context of arguing for his even more famous contractarian theory of justice; but as a moral epistemic idea, we can consider it apart from that context. According to Rawls, one achieves reflective equilibrium (narrowly conceived) when, and only when, one has brought all of her judgments about the rightness or wrongness of particular actions into ultimate harmony with all of one's judgments about what it is generally or universally right or wrong to do. Reflective equilibrium is a moral epistemic ideal: Rawls does not suggest that anyone has achieved or will achieve it. Nevertheless, he thinks that one is more or less justified in holding the moral beliefs one does happen to hold according to, and in virtue of, the extent to which she approaches reflective equilibrium (1971: 48-51). Reflective equilibrium is a kind of epistemic balance across levels of generality, achieved by facing and resolving conflicts between particular and general moral beliefs by means that are supposed to sort themselves out in the long run.

Some coherentist moral epistemologists, such as Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, argue that a broader conception of reflective equilibrium, which includes balance among not only our moral beliefs but also our non-moral beliefs. For instance, Sayre-McCord thinks the broader conception is better because requiring consistency between our moral and our non-moral beliefs is likely to rule out perverse but coherent sets of moral beliefs (1996: 166-70).

c. Contextualist Theories

Among close family I take for granted certain moral beliefs that I would be hard-pressed to defend at a meeting of my philosophical colleagues. Concerning the maintenance of my car, I take for granted many things that I would not take for granted if it were a passenger jet. Epistemic contextualism seems to vindicate such practices. It is the view that justified beliefs can owe their justifications to beliefs that are (even if not justified) not in need of justification under the circumstances. Beliefs not in need of justification under the circumstances are contextually basic. Which beliefs are contextually basic in a given context depends on the sorts of considerations raised in our examples above: Who am I talking to?, How serious is it if I am wrong?, and so forth

Mark Timmons is a recent moral epistemic contextualist. He argues for a context-dependent conception of epistemic responsibility that he thinks supports (epistemic) contextualism especially well in the case of moral beliefs. In actual practice, what constitutes epistemic responsibility—for example, checking such and such counterpossibilities before believing—varies according to context. In the moral case, people are especially prone to take for granted, and thus take to be epistemically responsible, certain mid-level moral generalizations (of the sort W. D. Ross thought are intuitive) that pass current in their contexts. These thus tend to serve as contextually basic in moral belief (Timmons, 1996). Of course, how much real epistemic justification one can get by extrapolating from his epistemically responsible (even if not justified) beliefs can vary according to the truth of those beliefs. For instance, Nazis extrapolating from their peculiar, shared, anti-Semitic beliefs can get very little epistemic justification. After all, one can take the conception of epistemic justification that is accepted in one's context to be epistemically significant when it is not, just as one can (in the arguably more idealized, less realistic, foundationalist and coherentist cases) take one's beliefs to be foundational or coherent when they are not.

d. Traditional Skepticism

Each broad theory-type above is, among other things, an attempt to solve a particular skeptical problem: the regress problem of justification. The problem can be presented in the form of an argument for a general, and not specifically moral, epistemic skepticism:

  1. If all justified beliefs owe their justifications via inference to other justified beliefs, then each justified belief owes its justification to other justified beliefs which owe their justifications to still further justified beliefs, and so on. Such chains of epistemic dependence must either
    1. never end, and thus form infinite regresses of justified beliefs, or
    2. end only when the chains form closed circles.
  2. All justified beliefs owe their justifications (via inference) to other justified beliefs.
  3. So all justified beliefs owe their justifications to chains of epistemic dependence of type (a) or type (b).
  4. But, if (3), then human beings can have no justified beliefs because
    1. human beings have finite minds and are thus incapable of possessing chains of epistemic dependence of type (a);
    2. chains of epistemic dependence of type (b) add up to, at best, circular arguments; circular arguments are never good reasons to believe; so allegedly justified beliefs that fall into type (b) dependence are not really justified.
  5. Hence, human beings can have no justified beliefs.

The apparent seriousness of this problem, combined with epistemic internalism’s demand that we face it head on, leads to the “priority of epistemic structure” assumption that is essential to traditional approaches. Foundationalism and contextualism try to defeat the regress argument by offering alternatives to premise (2). Coherentism tries to defeat it by offering holistic alternatives to the linear conception of epistemic dependence at work in premises (1) and (4).

To accept the soundness of the regress argument is to become a general, extreme kind of epistemic skeptic: it is to accept that we can have no justified beliefs and, thus, no knowledge. Such general, extreme epistemic skepticism is rare. Moral epistemic skepticism, on the other hand, is relatively common. It takes either weak or strong forms. According to weak (moral epistemic) skeptical theories, we can have justification for moral beliefs but we cannot have moral knowledge: the kinds or degrees of justification involved are too weak for knowledge. According to strong skeptical theories, we cannot even have justified moral beliefs.

At least one recent, strong moral epistemic skeptic is traditional (in our sense). Walter Sinnott-Armstrong thinks that the regress argument is sound, so long as by “beliefs” we mean “moral beliefs.” Perhaps, for instance, foundationalism is a good response to the regress problem in the case of our empirical—such as our perceptual—beliefs. In any case, he does not think that foundationalism works for moral beliefs. There are no good grounds, he argues, for accepting that we have a faculty that justifies foundational moral beliefs. Every attempt to argue that we do is essentially a form of dogmatism. It is an attempt to strongly insist on our most cherished moral beliefs in order to avoid having to defend them. Coherentism and contextualism fare even worse on Sinnott-Armstrong’s appraisal. They are not even viable as general epistemologies. No matter how coherent a set of beliefs is, there are any number of equally coherent sets that are inconsistent with it. So coherentism fails to explain how beliefs, in general, can be justified. Contextualists confuse mere persuasion with argument: for example, my ability to get you to agree to certain assumptions, and thus make them contextually basic, simply has no bearing on whether they are likely to be true, and, so, on whether we are justified in believing them (Sinnott-Armstrong,1996).

3. Non-Traditional Approaches

For various reasons, many philosophers reject one or more of the essential assumptions of traditional moral epistemology. Below we briefly introduce four sample kinds of non-traditional approaches. Unlike foundationalism, coherentism, and contextualism, these theories are all potentially compatible. There could be a reliabilist, noncognitivist, ideal-decision-based, politicized theory. Some of these are even, in the end, compatible with traditional theories (or close analogues of traditional theories). They all, however, reject one or more of the traditional assumptions as starting points.

a. Reliabilist Theories

I am probably average in my ability to correctly recognize dollar bills. Yet I am also, sadly, average in my lack of understanding of the complex physical, economic, sociological, and political conditions that make dollar bills be dollar bills. Somehow I nevertheless reliably recognize and daily form practically successful beliefs about dollar bills. If I am ever justified in believing that ‘here is a dollar bill’, I do not have in mind, and am not even capable of calling to mind without further research, all of the factors that make my belief true or that would justify it. Thus I cannot be justified, if traditional epistemic internalism is right, in believing that ‘here is a dollar bill’, despite my dollar-bill-reliability. David Copp (2000), the reliabilist moral epistemologist whose example this is, wants us to see that the traditional internalist outcome seems preposterous.

Of course I am justified in believing in many cases that ‘here is a dollar bill.’ So traditional epistemic internalism must be false. It is false because, Copp thinks, it is the reliability, or lack of reliability, of the processes by which we form beliefs that justifies, or fails to justify, our beliefs; not, as epistemic internalists insist, our deep skeptic-proof insight into their truth conditions. Whether we perceive, understand, or can even recognize, how such processes are reliable in us, as epistemic internalism demands, is beside the point.

Copp proposes and defends an anti-internalist, that is, externalist, moral epistemology. He argues that we (or at least the best of us) have a reliable moral sensitivity, much as we have a reliable dollar bill sensitivity. Our relevant moral sensitivity is made up of a certain combination of (i) a heightened tendency to notice morally relevant features of a situation, such as the pain produced by burning a cat alive and the much less morally significant enjoyment that doing this might bring to a gang of thugs; (ii) a reliable tendency to draw correct moral conclusions from these features, such as the conclusion that burning the cat, under the circumstances, is morally reprehensible; and (iii) a reliable tendency to be motivated in a morally appropriate way, such as being motivated to do something, if feasible, to prevent the thugs from burning the cat alive (2000; 55-58). We can, as ethical theorists do, legitimately struggle towards the exactly right combination of (i) – (iii). However we need not understand how they are connected with truth—a highly complicated matter of societal norms that appropriately arise from societies’ struggles to meet their “needs,” according to Copp—in order for our combinations of (i) – (iii) to justify our moral beliefs (1995). We need only have combinations that reliably produce true beliefs in us, in order for our (thus produced) moral beliefs to be justified.

b. Noncognitivist Theories

In his provocative attack on traditional, speculative philosophy, Language, Truth, and Logic, A. J. Ayer wrote ([1936]: 107):

…if I say to someone, “You acted wrongly in stealing that money,” I am not stating anything more than if I had simply said, “You stole that money.” In adding that this action is wrong I am not making any further statement about it. I am simply evincing my moral disapproval of it.

According to Ayer, moral language merely expresses emotion just as “a peculiar tone of horror” or “special exclamation marks” express feelings. It does not make claims: it has no content of a sort that can be true or false. Hence [moral] cognitivism—an essential ingredient of traditional moral epistemology—is false. So, the whole enterprise of moral epistemology, that is, the study of moral knowledge, is doomed from the start: there cannot be moral beliefs or truths, and because there cannot be justified true moral beliefs, there cannot be moral knowledge.

Ayer, however, does not mean to entirely relegate the concerns of moral epistemology to the dustbin. He only means to demote them. We can accept noncognitivism and still argue that some moral feelings are more reasonable or appropriate to given kinds of circumstances than others. We can have more or less justification (although not epistemic justification) for having, or tending to have, certain moral attitudes. We can thus have better and worse moral theories.

While we might think that noncognitivism degrades ethics too much by disconnecting it from the promise of truth, we might appreciate that it allows us to non-skeptically avoid a host of messy ethical and epistemic problems associated with moral realism. According to moral realism, moral claims represent the world as being thus and so; they are true when the world really is thus and so and false when it is not. It is hard to say for moral claims, however, what “thus and so” is supposed to be. Also, the very idea that moral “claims” represent the world as being a certain way is a suspect idea. It suggests that moral talk aims, like perceptual talk, at describing. But moral talk does not seem to aim at describing; it seems to aim at prescribing. Arguably, noncognitivism can make better sense of this than realism. Noncognitivism conceives moral talk as projecting moral emotion (Ayer, [1936]) or prescription (Hare, 1989) onto a perhaps otherwise indifferent world, rather than as representing the moral features of a world which contains no moral features.

Two especially influential recent noncognitivist theories are Simon Blackburn’s “quasi-realism” and Allan Gibbard’s “norm expressivism.” Blackburn’s quasi-realism combines an account of moral value as projected value with a sophisticated attempt to vindicate the rationality of certain indispensable (to moral discourse) practices that treat moral talk as if it were cognitive (1996; 1998). Gibbard’s norm-expressivism claims that moral judgment is a species of rationality judgment constituted by expressive, as opposed to cognitive, acceptance of norms or rules that determine in the moral case whether actions are forbidden, permitted, or required (1990).

c. Ideal Decision Theories

Ideal decision theories ascribe special philosophical importance to the moral decisions of idealized persons who decide under idealized circumstances. Only some ideal decision theories are moral epistemic theories (others are non-epistemic, for example, ethical or metaethical theories), and only some of those offer whole approaches to moral epistemology. Contractarianism and the sort of approach that Richard Brandt proposes are two ideal decision theories that are sometimes conceived as whole approaches to moral epistemology.

Contractarian theories seek to ratify moral claims by appeal to the agreement of fully rational, non-biased, well-informed people in real or, more often, imagined circumstances. For instance, John Rawls famously argued that principles of justice are morally binding on members of a society if and only if they would be unanimously agreed to by rational, relevantly-well-informed people in what he calls the “original position.” The original position is an imaginary situation walled off by a “veil of ignorance,” which prevents knowledge of the particular, personal features that engender biases, such as our sexes, ages, races, special tastes, talents, handicaps, or developed moral, political, or religious outlooks. Rawls, however, was a traditional coherentist when it came to moral epistemology. He did not view his contractarian decision procedure as either an ethical theory or a moral epistemology, but rather as a way of generating authoritative principles of justice that would dovetail with the best ethical theory and the best moral epistemology (1971).

Nevertheless, others have proposed and defended contractarian theories as ethical theories and/or moral epistemologies. For instance, a contractarian ethical theory might hold that actions are morally permissible if and only if they would not be rejected in something like Rawls’s original position. Some contractarian moral epistemologists think that discerning that a moral claim would be endorsed in something like the original position can justify someone in believing it (Gauthier, 1986; Morris, 1996). Although Rawls did not hold this view, he did see his method as a kind of access to deep facts about rationality itself, facts of the sort that his more traditional moral epistemology finds ultimately decisive.

Richard Brandt suggests a different, but related, ideal decision theory. A way to demonstrate the validity of a moral system is

…to show persons that if they were factually fully informed they would want a certain sort of moral system for the whole society in which they expect to live. (1996: 207-08)

This by no means makes moral knowledge easy to come by. But it does put it on the same sort of footing as our other knowledge, since all of our other knowledge is presumably about what the facts are, and to make a claim about what the facts are is to imply something about what it is like to be fully factually informed.

d. Politicized Theories

Most recent politicized theories are feminist theories. The very idea of feminist epistemology strikes many as a mistake. What could be more impartial, and less open to political interpretation, than standards of knowledge or justified belief? We may as well talk about feminist radio repair. However, feminist epistemologists often see the very mistake they want to address in such a response. This impartiality, or pretense of impartiality, in traditional epistemology blinds it to relevant information or standpoints of oppressed classes, such as women; or at least to the narrowness and biases that it is likely to have since its assumptions, methods, and so on were conceived and developed by socially privileged white men.

Anatole France ([1894]) famously wrote: “The law, in its majestic equality, forbids the rich, as well as the poor, to sleep under bridges, to beg in the streets, and to steal bread.” His irony is Marxist: Marx thought that the impartiality of laws can blind us to the very partialities they are designed to promote. Similarly, many feminist epistemologists argue that the alleged impartiality of traditional theories of justification or knowledge can blind us to the views of the world, and perhaps in particular the moral views of the world, they are designed to promote. Foundationalism, for instance, which looks on the surface like a logically motivated response to the regress problem of justification, has been considered to be just a method for vindicating the basic tenets of the foundationalist’s world view, whatever those happen to be.

What is it that white-male-dominated, traditional moral epistemology has missed? Let’s consider three kinds of feminist answers. (1) Susan Harding (1986) argues that the epistemic standpoints, that is, perspectives from which we collect evidence, of oppressed classes are epistemically better, that is, more likely to produce true beliefs, than the epistemic standpoints of oppressor classes, especially concerning the oppressor classes’ biases. For instance, an antebellum plantation owner would miss much that would be readily apparent to his lowliest slaves. For many topics, including moral ones, he is likely to live on some sort of epistemic Cloud Nine . (2) Traditional epistemology builds its misleading impartiality on taking knowledge to be an individual, rather than a community, activity. In fact, as the relative success of science illustrates, real knowing is a community activity: its body of knowledge improves only by surviving attempts by communities to refute it. By wrongly conceiving knowledge as an individual activity, traditional epistemology merely codifies the individual biases, including sexisms, of its conceivers. (3) Traditional epistemology is non-naturalized. So, it conceives actual knowledge-ascription or justification-ascription practices as mere subjects of epistemic evaluation, never as raw material upon which to base epistemic principles. Once we reverse this trend, and go in for naturalized epistemologies (see below), we can regard the actual social and linguistic circumstances of knowledge ascriptions as starting points. Once we do that, we can have, at best, only half of a good moral epistemic theory if we ignore the special moral epistemic practices, concerns, and paradigms provided by women (as traditional moral epistemology arguably has). Feminist moral epistemologists, such as Margaret Urban Walker (1996) and Lorraine Code (2000), have been leaders in the effort to naturalize moral epistemology.

4. Can Moral Epistemology Be Naturalized?

To naturalize a philosophical subject is to somehow bring it under the purview of natural science. What this means is controversial; but it is usually thought to involve both substantial and methodological projects. Substantially, it involves attempting to confine theories to existence claims that science countenances, or could eventually countenance. Methodologically, it involves attempting to limit philosophical inquiry to methods whose validity science can, or could eventually, vindicate.

There is nothing new about attempts to affect substantial naturalization in ethics. Over two centuries ago, Jeremy Bentham ([1781]) tried to conceive moral claims as substantially about quantities of pleasure and pain, and thus as about something that might be scientifically modeled and studied. Efforts to naturalize episstemology are a more recent phenomenon, with a more methodological focus. The naturalized epistemology movement was launched by W. V. Quine (1969), who rejected the traditional epistemological project of trying to discover, through conceptual analysis, skeptic-proof, a priori conditions for knowledge or justification. He proposed, instead, that epistemology be reconceived as a branch of empirical psychology. Many of his followers propose less radical reforms. What they have in common is that they reject a fully traditional approach in favor of “…an anti-skeptical, or at least non-skeptical, empirically informed investigation of the grounds of knowledge” (Copp, 2000: 39).

The effort to naturalize moral epistemology is even more recent. Most attempts take one or more of three forms: reliabilism, feminism, and scientism (or so we will call it). Below, we say a bit about each of these and introduce two objections that naturalized moral epistemologists strive to overcome.

Some epistemic reliabilists try to naturalize epistemology, in general, by identifying epistemic justification with observable and measurable consequences: such as facts about the reliability of the various processes by which we arrive at beliefs (for example, Goldman, 1994). Their rejection of traditional epistemic internalism makes room for an anti-skeptical stance by allowing justification and even knowledge in the absence of answers to traditional skeptical problems like the regress problem. David Copp (2000), whose moral epistemic reliabilism we sketched above, conceives his reliabilism as a naturalized moral epistemology, and defends it against several objections, including those we mention below.

Feminists stand to gain from naturalized moral epistemology room to urge the relevance of their various empirical critiques of the impartiality of traditional ethics and epistemology. The traditional pretense of impartiality in epistemology was largely upheld by the traditional conception of epistemology as only susceptible to a priori investigation. Naturalized moral epistemology opens the door to, and can even privilege, the sorts of psychological and sociological facts that feminist moral epistemologists seek to call attention to.

Theories that promote scientism propose and evaluate moral epistemic theories on the basis of current scientific theory, such as current sociology, psychology, artificial intelligence, and neuroscience. For instance, Paul Churchland (2000) tries to reconceive moral epistemology so that moral knowledge has much less to do with the truth of general moral and epistemic principles than with a kind of skill by which we build and more or less ably negotiate complex brain-to-social-space relations.

One of the largest sources of objections to naturalized ethics or epistemology concerns the essential normativity (value-ladenness, prescriptivity) of both ethics and epistemology. Ethics is essentially normative because it is about what we should do, not what we do. Epistemology is essentially normative because it is about what our epistemic standards should be, not what they are. Science, on the other hand, is purely descriptive. Its subject matter—how the natural world in fact is—is not normative. How then can ethics or epistemology be brought within the purview of natural science? If we try to assimilate the naturalization of both ethics and epistemology into a naturalized moral epistemology, then the problem gets even worse: neither ethics nor epistemology can derive their essential normativity from the other.

Arguably, moral and epistemic principles must be general, in the sense that they cover indefinitely many particular instances of rightness, goodness, knowledge, and so on. Science can produce generalities, such as natural laws, on the basis of generalizing from particular observations. However, as Immanuel Kant ([1785]: 63) pointed out, in order to soundly generalize to moral [or epistemic] principles in the scientific way, one would have to already know which examples, which observations or theoretical entities, are morally relevant; and one can only know that on the basis of other general moral [or epistemic] principles. Thus, if we are limited to scientific generalization from examples, then we are trapped, unable to generate the general moral [or epistemic] principles we need in order to get started.

5. Moral Epistemology & Metaethics

Metaethics is the part of ethical theory which studies the deep, often non-moral assumptions behind our moral thought. Here are some important metaethical topics:

  1. moral epistemology;
  2. moral semantics, the study of how and what moral language means;
  3. moral ontology, the study of what sort(s) of reality underwrites the truth or reasonableness of moral claims or attitudes; and
  4. moral psychology, the study of the nature of, and relations among, moral mental states, such as morally-relevant beliefs, desires, intentions and motivations.

Such topics are difficult to pursue in a vacuum. Not only does each involve an intersection or overlap between ethical theory and some other enormous topic, their problems are often inextricably interdependent.

For instance, the problem of what the objects of moral knowledge could be is larger than moral epistemology; it is also a problem of moral ontology and moral semantics. We conclude with a brief look at this problem. We access it through the general outline of a dilemma posed by A. J. Ayer against moral cognitivism. We borrow from Michael Smith (1994) the idea of using Ayer’s dilemma as a window into recent metaethics. However, we do not closely follow Ayer in developing the details of the dilemma nor explore Smith’s more sophisticated treatment.

Ayer’s Dilemma (Ayer, [1936]: 103-06): Assume moral cognitivism. If any moral claims are true, some sort of reality—something we can think of them as representing—underwrites their truth. This reality must be either something natural or something non-natural. However, if it is something natural, then it must fall victim to G. E. Moore’s arguments against ethical naturalism. If it is something non-natural, then it must either also fall victim to Moore’s arguments against ethical naturalism or fall victim to a host of other insuperable problems. So no moral claims are true.

Obviously, Ayer’s Dilemma leans heavily on G. E. Moore’s arguments against ethical naturalism. We briefly describe two of these, consider how they also preclude some non-naturalist theories, and then give some examples of the alleged host of other insuperable problems that confront the ethical non-naturalist.

Like Moore, let's simplify by calling "the Good" whatever it is that all true moral claims collectively represent as being the case. Ethical naturalism is the view that the Good is something natural. By “natural” Moore meant “…the subject matter of the natural sciences and…psychology,” or “…all that has existed or will exist in time” ([1903]: 92). Moore’s two most famous arguments against ethical naturalism are the naturalistic fallacy argument and the open question argument. According to the naturalistic fallacy argument, any attempt to identify the Good with something natural must commit a fallacy because goodness is a normative (value-laden, prescriptive) property and because nature is decidedly non-normative (value-neutral, descriptive). According to the open question argument, good definitions “close” certain questions for competent users of the term defined. For instance, competent users of the term, “triangle,” cannot wonder whether there are any round triangles. But no identification of the Good with something natural can have this feature: competent users of “good” will always be able to wonder whether the natural states of affairs in the definition are really good, and vice versa ([1903]).

Many philosophers think that Moore’s definition of “natural” is flawed. However, this matters little for our purpose since his arguments seem to work, if they work, against ethical naturalist theories of every stripe, and against many non-natural ones. They work, if they work, against any position that identifies the Good with something non-normative, even if it is something theological.

What remains, then, is to identify the Good with something non-natural and normative. This seems to imply that the Good must be sui generis, that is, utterly unique. This is the option which, according to Ayer’s Dilemma, must fall victim to “a host of other insuperable problems.” We will briefly mention three of these. First, if the Good is sui generis, then we cannot defend the possibility of moral knowledge, since we have no independent evidence of an epistemic faculty that apprehends something as being both morally significant and utterly unique. Second, if the Good is sui generis, then knowing what is good could not provide motivation for doing what is good. Third, if the Good is sui generis, then we are left without any possible explanation for why moral properties supervene on natural (or at least non-normative) properties; that is, why we cannot conceive any difference in correct moral assessment when we cannot point to any difference in the plain facts.

Responses to Ayer’s Dilemma: One way to respond to Ayer’s Dilemma is to accept it. This leaves two alternatives: keep cognitivism and become a skeptic or, as Ayer preferred, abandon cognitivism. J. L. Mackie (1977) kept cognitivism and became a skeptic. He argued that our realm of moral discourse, just like our realm of, say, Santa Claus discourse, is nothing more nor less than a large body of false claims. Ayer ([1936]), R. M. Hare (1989), Simon Blackburn (1996, 1998), and Allan Gibbard (1990) all chose, instead, to abandon cognitivism and to defend on a noncognitivist basis the possibility of something like moral knowledge,.

Another option is to keep cognitivism and reject either the anti-naturalistic or the anti-non-naturalistic horn of the dilemma. Let’s consider post-Ayer ethical naturalist theories, first.

Some ethical naturalists think that the Good is both natural and sui generis. For instance, “Cornell Realists,” such as Nicolaus Sturgeon (1989), David Brink (1989), and Geoffrey Sayre-McCord (1988) think that every particular instantiation of the Good can be identified with a natural state of affairs, such as an instance of moral rightness with some act of kindness under a natural description. However, they think that the Good, itself, cannot be identified with anything these natural instantiations all have in common. Instead, moral properties like goodness and rightness have irreducible, and thus sui generis, explanatory power of their own.

Others think that the Good is natural and not sui generis: it reduces to some natural property or properties. For instance, Peter Railton argues that it reduces to being what we would want for us, as we really are now, to want, if we had “unqualified cognitive and imaginative powers, and full factual and nomological information about…[our]…physical and psychological constitution.” (1986: 173-74). Other “Reductionist” naturalists include Gilbert Harmon (1975); Richard Brandt (1979); David Lewis (1986); and Frank Jackson, Philip Pettit and Michael Smith (2004). Reductionist naturalists typically respond to Moore’s anti-naturalistic arguments by arguing that their reductions—that is, their identifications of the Good with something natural—are a posteriori (experience-based) identifications, rather than a priori, and thus are immune to his criticisms.

Among ethical non-naturalists we must include Moore ([1903]). He accepted that the Good is sui generis, and he argued that we have an intuitive epistemic faculty that apprehends goodness and thus grounds our beliefs about what is good or right. Although his positive view is often rejected as a reduction to absurdity of ethical non-naturalism, it has had important recent defenders, for example, Panayot Butchvarov (1989).

Most recent defenders of ethical non-naturalism reject the sui generis view, or at least Moore’s version of it. Some argue that we can tell what constitutes the telos (roughly, proper function) of something that has one, provided that we know enough about it; and thus we can know what constitutes the Good for it. The facts about telos for some things—especially the most morally considerable things, like people—cannot all be identified with something natural, at least not in anything like Moore’s sense of “natural.” (Foot, 1978; MacIntyre, 1984)

Many non-naturalists reject that the Good exists, per se, in the world that science studies, and they argue instead that it arises as a necessary byproduct of any attempt to pursue purposive, or goal-driven, rational activities—such as perceiving or understanding or inferring or deliberating or intending or acting. The Good belongs, as John McDowell (1994) says, to the “space of reasons.” Such views are capable of broadly Aristotelian, Kantian, or existentialist development. In any case, they can require that the “space of reasons” be sensitive to facts (whether natural, and thus unique to the world that science models and studies, or non-natural) and logic. The Aristotelian turn conceives the space of reasons as a product of social relations, engendered by the necessary formation of interpersonal relationships and conveyed by societally-sanctioned forms of education (McDowell, 1994; MacIntyre, 1984). The Kantian turn conceives the “space of reasons” in more individualistic terms: the choices of individuals are morally evaluable according to whether the principles implicit (or explicit) in them pass some objective test, or tests, of rationality, such as being permitted by Kant’s Categorical Imperative (Korsgaard, 1996; Audi, 2004). Finally, the existentialist turn views facts and logic as radically underdetermining the rationality of choices, a short-coming that can only be made up for by adopting some thoroughly subjective criteria, usually some kind of authenticity, or trueness to oneself (Kierkegaard, [1843]; Sartre, 1992).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Audi, Robert, Moral Knowledge and Ethical Character, Oxford: Oxford University press, 1997.
  • Audi, The Good in the Right: A Theory of Intuition and Intrinsic Value, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2004.
  • Ayer, A.J., Language, Truth and Logic [1936], New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1952.
  • Bentham, Jeremy, The Principles of Morals and Legislation, [1781] Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 1988.
  • Blackburn, Simon, “Securing the Nots: Moral Epistemology for the Quasi-Realist,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Blackburn, Simon, Ruling Passions, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998.
  • BonJour, Laurence, The Structure of Empirical Justification, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1985.
  • Brandt, Richard, “Science as a Basis for Moral Theory,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Brink, David, Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Campbell, Richard & Hunter, Bruce, “Introduction,” eds. Richmond Campbell and Bruce Hunter, Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Calgary, Alberta: University of Calgary Press, 2000.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, The Foundations of Knowing, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
  • Code, Lorraine, “Statements of Fact: Whose? Where? When?,” eds. Richmond Campbell and Bruce Hunter, Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Calgary, Alberta: University of Calgary Press, 2000.
  • Copp, David, Morality, Normativity, and Society, New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Copp, David, “Four Epistemological Challenges to Ethical Naturalism,” eds. Richmond Campbell and Bruce Hunter, Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Calgary, Alberta: University of Calgary Press, 2000.
  • Dancy, Jonathan, Moral Reasons, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 1993.
  • Dancy, Jonathan, “The Particularist’s Progress,” eds. Brad Hooker and Margaret Little, Moral Particularism, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000.
  • Ewing, A. C., The Definition of Good, New York: The Macmillan Company, 1949.
  • Foot, Philippa, Virtues and Vices, University of California Press, 1978.
  • Gauthier, David, Morals by Agreement, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1986.
  • Gewirth, Alan, Reason and Morality, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1978.
  • Gibbard, Allan, Wise Choices, Apt Feelings, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990.
  • Goldman, Alvin, “What is Justified Belief?” ed. by Hilary Kornblith, Epistemology Naturalized, 2nd Ed., Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1994.
  • Harding, Sandra, The Science Question in Feminism, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1986.
  • Hare, R(ichard) M., Essays in Ethical Theory, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Hare, R(ichard) M., “Foundationalism and Coherentism in Ethics,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Harman, Gilbert, Morality, New York: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Hooker, Brad, Ideal Code, Real World, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000.
  • Hume, David, A Treatise of Human Nature, [1740] 2nd Ed., ed. by L. A. Selby-Bigge, rev. by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Hutcheson, Frances, An Inquiry Into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Nature, [1725] New York: Garland Publishers, 1971.
  • Jackson, Frank, Pettit, Philip, and Smith, Michael; Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Kant, Immanuel, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals [1785], tr. by Mary Gregor, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Kierkegaard, Soren, Fear and Trembling / Repetition, tr. Howard V. Hong, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983, pp. 54-67.
  • Korsgaard, Christine, The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Mackie, J. L., Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, New York: Penguin, 1977.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair, After Virtue, 2nd Ed., Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984.
  • McDowell, John, Mind and World, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1994.
  • McNaughton, David, “Intuitionism,” Blackwell Guide to Ethical Theory, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2000, pp. 268-287.
  • Miller, Alexander, An Introduction to Metaethics, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2003.
  • Moore, G. E., Principia Ethica, [1903], rev. edn., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Morris, Christopher, “A Contractarian Account of Moral Justification,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Quine, W.V.O., “Epistemology Naturalized,” Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, New York: Columbia University Press, 1969.
  • Railton, Peter, “Moral Realism,” Philosophical Review 95, 1986.
  • Rawls, John, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1971.
  • Ross, W. D., The Right And The Good [1930], Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1988.
  • Ross, W. D., The Foundations of Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1936.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul, Notebook For an Ethics, [posthumous publication] tr. David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey, “Moral Theory and Explanatory Impotence,” Midwest Studies 12, 1988, pp. 433-57.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey, “Coherentist Epistemology and Moral Theory,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Scanlon, T. M., What We Owe to Each Other, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1998.
  • Sidgwick, Henry, The Methods of Ethics [1907], Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1981.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, Walter, “Moral Skepticism and Justification,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Smith, Michael, The Moral Problem, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers Ltd, 1994.
  • Sturgeon, Nicholas, “Moral Explanations,” Essays on Moral Realism, ed. by Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1989, 229-55.
  • Timmons, Mark, “Outline of a Contextualist Moral Epistemology,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Walker, Margaret Urban, “Feminist Skepticism, Authority, and Transparency,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.

Author Information

Peter Tramel
United States Military Academy
U. S. A.

Hellenistic Astrology

fatesHellenistic and Late Antiquity astrologers built their craft upon Babylonian (and to a lesser extent Egyptian) astrological traditions, and developed their theoretical and technical doctrines using a combination of Stoic, Middle Platonic and Neopythagorean thought. Astrology offered fulfillment of a desire to systematically know where an individual stands in relation to the cosmos in a time of rapid political and social changes. Various philosophers of the time took up polemics against astrology while accepting some astral theories. The Stoic philosopher Posidonius was alleged to embrace astrology and write works on it (Augustine, De civitate dei, 5.2). Other Stoics such as Panaetius and (late) Diogenes of Babylon were primarily adverse to astrological determinism. For some philosophers such as Plotinus, horoscopic astrology was absurd for reasons such that the planets could never bear ill will toward human beings whose souls were exalted above the cosmos. For others, such as the early Church Fathers, ethical implications of astrological fatalism were the main point of contention, as it was contrary to the emerging Christian doctrine of free will. The Gnostics, who for the most part believed the cosmos is the product of an evil and enslaving creator, thought of the planets as participants in this material entrapment. Prominent Neoplatonists such as Porphyry, Iamblichus, and Proclus found some aspects of astrology compatible with their versions of Neoplatonic philosophy. The cultural importance of astrology is attested to by the strong reactions to and involvement with astrology by various philosophers in late antiquity. The adaptability of astrology to various philosophical schools as well as the borrowing on the part of astrologers from diverse philosophies provides dynamic examples of the rich "electicism" or "syncretism" that characterized the Hellenistic world.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
    1. Babylonian Astrology in the Hellenized World
    2. Hellenistic Theorization and Systemization of Astrology
  2. Early Greek Thinking
    1. Fate, Fortune, Chance, Necessity
    2. Greek Medicine
    3. Plato and Divination
    4. Ages, Cycles, and Rational Heavens
  3. Philosophical Foundation of Hellenistic Astrology
    1. Astral Piety in Plato's Academy
    2. Stoic Cosmic Determinism
      1. Fate and Necessity
      2. Stoic-Babylonian Eternal Recurrence
      3. Divination and Cosmic Sympathy
      4. The Attitude of Stoic Philosophers Towards Astrology
    3. Middle Platonic and Neopythagorean Developments
      1. Ocellus Lucanus
      2. Timaeus Locrus
      3. Thrasyllus
      4. Plutarch
  4. The Astrologers
    1. The Earliest Hellenistic Astrology: Horoscopic and Katarchic
    2. Earliest Fragments and Texts
    3. Manilius
    4. Claudius Ptolemy of Alexandria
    5. Vettius Valens
  5. The Skeptics
    1. The New Academy (Carneades)
    2. Sextus Empiricus
  6. Hermetic and Gnostic Astrological Theories
  7. Neoplatonism and Astrology
    1. Plotinus
    2. Porphyry
    3. Iamblichus
    4. Firmicus Maternus
    5. Hierocles
    6. Proclus
  8. Astrology and Christianity
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

a. Babylonian Astrology in the Hellenized World

Astrology, loosely defined as a method of correspondences between celestial events and activity in the human realm, has played a role in nearly every civilization. Its role in the late-Hellenistic era is of special concern, particularly due to its complex interaction with Greek philosophy, as well as its claims on the life of an individual. A horoscopic chart (also "birth chart," "natal chart," or "horoscope") is a list of planetary positions against a backdrop of zodiac signs, divided into regions of the sky (with reference to the rising and setting stars on the horizon) on the basis of one's exact time and place of birth. Such charts form the basis of "natal astrology" or "genethlialogy," which started in Babylon but was later developed in Hellenized Greek speaking regions.

The earliest surviving horoscopic chart pertaining to an individual is dated 410 B.C.E. in Babylon. Babylonian astrology flourished from the seventh century to the Seleucid era (late fourth century). However, astral religion and divination based on star omens have a much longer history in Mesopotamia. Stars were considered to be representations of gods whose favors could be courted through prayers, magical incantations and amulets. The triad of Anu, Enlil, and Ea corresponded not with individual stars or planets but to three bands of constellations. Traces of the basic characters of the planetary gods, such as the malevolent nature of Mars/Nergal (the god of destruction and plagues) and Venus/Ištar (the goddess of love), can be found in Hellenistic astrology. Given the small available sample of Late Babylonian horoscopic tablets containing planetary placements and laconic predictions (around 28 extant), it is very difficult to come to solid conclusions about the theoretical ground for the practice of the earliest horoscopic astrologers. The case will be different in the Hellenistic culture in which theoretical grounding was important for the development of the practice, and in which there is more extensive textual evidence.

Given the dynamic tension resulting from Greek philosophy meeting Egyptian, Babylonian, Persian and Jewish religions and ideologies, and the "syncretism" of cross-cultural influences, the Hellenistic era provided fruitful soil for the cultivation of what began primarily as a Mesopotamian system of celestial omens. Before Alexander's conquest, the practice of astronomy and astrology in Babylon flourished but was not yet of much interest to the Greek thinkers. Babylonian priests/astrologers, notably Berossus, who settled on the island of Cos, are thought to be responsible for introducing astrology to Greece and the surrounding area. Plato mentions those who seek celestial portents in the Timaeus (40c-d), while the student of Plato who authored the Epinomis paved the way for application of astronomical studies to astral piety.

As the intellectual center in Egypt, Alexandria is a likely location for major developments in Hellenistic astrology. A portion of what Garth Fowden (in Egyptian Hermes) classified as "technical Hermetica," material typically earlier than the "philosophical Hermetica," represents a part of the early Hellenistic astrological corpus. Surviving Greek astrological writings, catalogued over a period of fifty years in a work called the Catalogus Codicum Astrologorum Graecorum (CCAG), reveal that for the sake of credibility, many of the Hellenistic astrologers attributed the earliest astrological works to historical or mythologized figures such as the pharaoh Nechepso, an Egyptian priest associated with Petosiris. Hermes is a legendary figure credited with the invention of astrology. Some fragments attributed to Hermes survive while some of the Nechepso/Petosiris work from the mid-second century B.C.E. survives in quotes by later authors. Asclepius, Anubio, Zoroaster, Abraham, Pythagoras, and Orpheus are additional figures having astrological works penned in their names. There are late Hellenistic references to three Babylonian astronomers/astrologers, Kidinnu (Kidenas), Soudines (the source of some material for second century C.E. astrologer, Vettius Valens), and Naburianos. The rivalry between the Seleucid and Ptolemaic kingdoms may be reflected in the astrologers' varying attributions of the origins of astrology to Egyptians or Babylonians (called the Chaldaeans). Various astrological techniques and tables are either attributed to Egyptians or Chaldaeans, but by late antiquity, the source for specific techniques and approaches were often wrongly attributed. By the second century B.C.E., Babylonian astrology techniques were combined with Egyptian calendars and religious practices, Hermeticism, the Pythagorean sacred mathematics, and the philosophies of the Stoics and middle Platonists.

b. Hellenistic Theorization and Systemization of Astrology

Hellenistic astrology displays the influence of a variety of philosophical sources. However, given the divergent and ever multiplying streams of thought in the Hellenized world, practical astrology did not necessarily conform to one particular philosophical model offered by the major philosophical schools. However, as outlined below, the Neopythagoreans, Platonists and Stoics provided the foundational influence on the development of the art.

After a system or systems of Hellenistic astrology quickly developed, the later practitioners and writers did not follow any one philosophical influence as a whole. In fact, the surviving instructional texts only scantily betray the philosophical positions of the authors. Vettius Valens, whose Anthologiarum is one of the most valuable sources for historians of this subject, indicates Stoic leanings. The astrologer, astronomer, and geographer whose work greatly influenced later development of astrology, Claudius Ptolemy (fl. 130-150 C.E.), using Aristotelian influenced manners of argumentation that had been absorbed by other Hellenistic schools such as the Middle Platonists and the Academic Skeptics, sought to portray astrology as a natural science, while dismissing a good portion of doctrine due to lack of systematic rigor. The later Platonic Academy had its fair share of astrological interest – head of the academy in the first century C.E., Thrasyllus, for example, acted as an astrologer to Emperor Tiberius and is credited for works on astrology and numerology. Neoplatonists Porphyry, Iamblichus and Proclus all practiced or accepted some form of astrology conforming to their unique contributions to Neoplatonism. It is difficult to imagine that the practice of astrology would have been divorced from philosophy by philosophers who were also astrologers. The idea of astrology, as a systematic account of fate, had a pervasive impact on the influential thinkers of the time who helped to shape the theoretical and cosmological understanding of the practice. Thinkers in the skeptical Academy and Pyrrhonic schools sought to attack the theoretical underpinnings of the practice of astrology, using a variety of arguments centering around freedom, the ontological status of the stars and planets, and the logical or practical limitations of astrological claims.

We now turn to the philosophies and philosophical schools of the Hellenic and Hellenized world that made the spread and acceptance of Babylonian astrology possible.

2. Early Greek Thinking

a. Fate, Fortune, Chance, Necessity

The role of Fate was often interchangeable with that of the gods in early Greek thinking. Fate implied foreknowledge, which was divine and sometimes dispensed by the gods. The intervention of the gods in human affairs also presented the possibility of two paths of fate, based on a moral choice. A decision that pleased or displeased the gods (such as the choice Odysseus must make regarding the Oxen of the Sun (Odyssey, Book XII) could set one off on a road of inexorable circumstances to follow.

For the pre-Socratic philosophers, personified powers - such as Moira (Fate or Destiny) Anankê(Necessity), Nemesis, Heimarmenê (Fate), Sumphora (Chance) and Tukhê (Fortune or Chance) – took on both metaphysical significances and personifications that blurred any distinction between the theological and the ontological. In thinkers such as Anaximander, Moira and Tukhê play a part in cosmology that exceeds and is possibly even prior to the gods. While the Olympian gods may be given foresight into the workings of Moira, they were often left without the power to transgress this transcendental dispensation of justice. Nature and the gods were both encompassed by Moira. At this time in Greek thinking, Fate and Fortune, and Zeus as its capricious dispenser, fell outside the pale of human understanding, for leading a virtuous life was no insurance of protection from material ruin. This sense of futility resulted in the pessimism of Ionian thinkers such as Mimnermus and Semonides. The attitude toward Moira and Tukhê by Archilochus is wholly pessimistic, for Moira and Tukhê were the sole dispensers of good and evil, with no possibility of mediation. We see the emergence of the question of the role of human responsibility in justice and injustice in early Greek thinking (that is, Solon), but it is unusual to see sharp distinctions between circumstantial Fate that dispenses good or evil and the human response to fate through virtue that was to later develop in Hellenistic thinking (such as found in the later Stoic position that happiness is self-control in spite of an immutable Fate). Theognis, however, offers a proto-Stoic forebearance of Fate and triumph of human character, while he expresses the frustration of apparent injustice in the dispensation of good to the wicked and bad to the innocent. Democritus reacted to skepticism based on the whims of Chance by favoring a causal determinism ruled by necessity (anankê). Attribution of events to Chance, he claimed, was an excuse for one's lack of vigilance of the chain of causality (Fr. 119, Diels-Kranz). While not claiming such a thing as absolute chance, Democritus retained chance to indicate an obscure cause or causes.

We find in pre-Socratic thinking a stage set for the overcoming of the limitations of knowledge about the laws of the cosmos, not simply on a universal scale, but on the level of individual fortune as well. Hellenistic astrologers, in part, attempted to provide a complex astral logic to explain the apparent injustices of Fate. They attempted to fill this gap of knowledge and turn Chance and Fate into a predictable science for the initiated.

b. Greek Medicine

The development of Greek medical theory brought about a distinction between a basic "human nature" (koinê phusis) and an "individual nature" (idiê phusis). Greek medicine was motivated by the idea that nature has a unity and lawfulness. In the manner of Democritian Atomism, even Tukhê is causal, but not necessarily predictable. A Hippocratean would classify an individual's psychophysical nature into one of four types based on the qualities of hot, cold, moist, and dry. Astrologers borrowed and elaborated upon the psychology and character typology found in early medical theory (cf. Manilius, Astronomica, 2.453-465; Ptolemy, Tetrabiblos, 3.12.148). In turn, astrology in the Hellenistic era was to in turn inform medical theory with 1) zodiacal and planetary melothesia (the association of astral phenomenon at birth with physical type), 2) iatromathematics (which included consideration of auspicious and inauspicious times), 3) sympathies and antipathies between healing plants and celestial bodies, and 4) prognostication of the course of an illness, of life expectancy or recovery, based on the moment a person fell ill. Melothesia and iatromathematics are found in the works of astrologers Manilius, Teucer (Teukros) of Babylon, Ptolemy, and Firmicus Maternus, as well as a variety of anonymous and pseudepigraphal works. (cf. Serapion, CCAG, 1.101-102; Pythagoras, CCAG, 11.2.124-138).

Galen's own position on astrology was nuanced, for he rejected some aspects of astrological doctrine as it had been applied to medicine (particularly the Pythagorean numerology used in critical days, and the association of thirty-six healing plants with the Egyptian decans), while he supported other astrological considerations such as the Moon phases and relationship to planets for prognosis. Two of his works pertaining directly to this topic, On the Critical Days and Prognostication of Disease by Astrology. InOn the Critical Days Galen claimed an empirical basis for his selective acceptance, favoring astronomical accuracy (with fractional measures) over the Pythagorean doctrines in astrology (such as seven days per quarter cycle of the Moon). A passage in On the Natural Faculties (1.12.29) also alludes to his support of astrology in general and to a lost work on the physician Asclepiades where he dealt with the topics of omen, dreams and astrology. The context of the passage reveals that his theoretical acceptance of astrology is due to his Vitalist view of Nature (that the natural world is a living organism) as opposed to the Atomistic view of Nature (that all things are composed of inanimate atoms). Nature, for Galen (drawing upon the Vitalist position of Hippocrates) possesses faculties of attraction and assimilation of that which is appropriate (e.g., for an organism) and of expulsion of that which is foreign. Nature also provides the soul with innate ideas such as the virtues of courage, wisdom, temperance, etc. Omens and astrology are signs of Nature's providence and artistry of the principles of assimilation and expulsion. The Atomist (Epicurean) school rejected astrology and divination by dreams and omens because they believed there is no causality and purpose in Nature, so there is no means of producing these "signs" or correspondences and no means of prediction by way of them.

c. Plato and Divination

Babylonian astrology was not wholly unknown to the Greeks prior to Alexander's campaign. Plato, for instance, demonstrates an awareness of divination by the stars in the Timaeus dialogue, in which the protagonist criticizes divination by the stars without the means of astronomical calculation (logizethai) and a model (mimêmaton) of the heavens:

To describe the dancing movements of these gods, their juxtapositions and the back-circlings and advances of their circular courses on themselves; to tell which of the gods come into line with one another at their conjunctions and how many of them are in opposition, and in what order and at which times they pass in front of or behind one another, so that some are occluded from our view to reappear once again, thereby bring terrors and portents of things to come to those who cannot reason – to tell all this without the use of visible models would be labor spend in vain. 40c-d, Donald J. Zeyl translation, emphasis mine).

Each astronomical consideration listed in this passage, the conjunctions and oppositions, the occlusion or heliacal settings of planets and stars, the retrogradation are basic considerations in Babylonian (and subsequently Greek) astronomy. This passage may allude to early exposure of the Greeks to astrological methods more akin to numerology rather than based on astronomical observation, for the use of visible models can more accurately measure celestial phenomena. It may also be taken as evidence that Plato is at least aware of the Babylonian practice of omenic astrology or the horoscopy that emerged in the fifth century B.C.E. Also in the Timaeus, Plato mentions the "young gods" whose job it is to steer souls. The identity of these gods would become a problem in later Platonism, but they are established, at least by the first century as planetary god (Philo, De opificio mundi, 46-47). As this dialogue was treated with great importance in Platonism during the formative period of Hellenistic astrology, this passage could have been used by those looking for philosophical justification for the practice. Plato further expresses in the Laws(7.821a-822c; 10.986e) the value of studying astronomy for the sake of astral piety. He points out that the name planetos (from "to wander") is a misnomer, for the Sun, Moon and planets display a cyclical regularity in their course that can be more accurately understood by astronomical research. We can suspect, in this regard, the influence of contemporary astronomers and students in the academy such as Eudoxus. Astral piety, however, is to be contrasted with "astrology" proper that originated with the attempt to apply reason, order, and predictability to phenomena that had been previously considered to be merely astral omens.

Plato held in low regard the divinatory arts that are not prophetic, i.e., a madness (manic/mantic) directly inspired by the gods (cf. Ion). He expressed an attitude of ambiguity toward divination revealed in the double-edged characterization of Theuth (cf. Phaedo, 274a), the inventor of number, calculation, geometry, astronomy, games and writing. Just as writing results in a soul's forgetfulness through the mediation of symbols, semiotic or sign-based prediction, as astrology was often considered, is inferior to directly inspired prophecy (Phaedo, 244c).

d. Ages, Cycles, and Rational Heavens

As early as Hesiod, the Greeks mythologized ages of civilization. The Golden Age, in which the gods walked upon the earth, gave way to Silver, then Bronze, then Iron Age. Empedocles taught of a natural cycle of the interplay of Love and Strife: Love and harmony dominated one Age, then Strife in the next Age. Plato also expresses world ages, particularly in the Statesman or Politicus (269d-274d). Throughout the myths in this dialogue and others, he introduced the notion of a "cosmos" or a rational order and ontological hierarchy of the spheres of heavenly beings, elements, daimons, and earthly inhabitants. The cosmologies in Plato's dialogues marked the emergence of a rational cosmic order in place of earlier cosmogonies. His Timaeus dialogue, with its detailed story of the creation of the world, was to become, perhaps the most influential book along with the Septuagint in the late Hellenistic era). Babylonian astronomical cycles would, soon after Plato, fuse with Greek cosmologies. In the Myth of Er in the Republic, Plato describes the cosmos as held together by the Spindle of Necessity, such that the spheres of the fixed stars and the planets are held together by an axis of a spindle. Sirens sing to move the spheres (or whorls) while the Three Moirai participate in turning the wheel. Each whorl has its own speed, with the sphere of the fixed stars moving the fastest and in the direction opposite those of the planets. In the Phaedrus (245c-248c) dialogue, he further illustrates the Law of Destiny that governs souls who accompany the procession of the gods in a heavenly circuit for a period of 1000 years. If the souls remember the Good (those of the philosophers) they will regain lost wings of immortality in three circuits or 3000 years. Otherwise they fall to the earth and continue a cycle of rebirths for 10,000 years. Immortal souls dwell in the rim of the heavens among the stars.

This leads to another significant development introduced by Plato, one that would become critical for the Hellenistic spread of astrology and astral piety - the ensouled nature of celestial bodies. Plato gives the planets and stars a divine ontological status absent in the writings of the pre-Socratics, many of whom took the planets and stars to be material bodies of one substance or another. (for example, Anaxagoras [Plato,Apology, 26d]; Xenophanes [Aetius, De placitis reliquiae, 347.1]; Anaximander [Aristotle De caelo, 295b10]; Leucippus and Democritus [Diogenes Laertius, Lives, 9.30-32]). In the Laws (10.893b-899d; 12.966e-967d), Plato posits that Soul is older than created things and an immanent governor of the world of changing matter. Secondly, the motion of the stars and other heavenly bodies are under the systematic governance of Nous. That the circuits of the planets and stars have an ordered regularity or rationality, and that they are always in motion, indicates that they are immortal and ensouled (cf. Phaedrus, 245c). While leaving open the question of whether the Sun, Moon and planets create their own physical bodies or inhabit them as vehicles, Plato includes in the Athenian's argument that celestial beings are in fact gods, and (unlike the thought of the Atomists) are engaged in the affairs of human beings (Laws, 10.899a-d). Pre-Socratic philosophers such as Anaxagoras who believed that mind (Nous) governs the cosmos, failed in their cosmological account by not also recognizing the priority of soul over body (Laws, 12.967b-d). The conception of mind moving soulless bodies, noted the Athenian, led to common accusations that studying astronomy promotes impiety.

As Babylonian astronomical cycles met with a rational and ensouled Greek cosmos, the basis for both Stoic eternal recurrence and technical Hellenistic astrology was formed.

3. Philosophical Foundation of Hellenistic Astrology

a. Astral Piety in Plato's Academy

The Platonic dialogue Epinomis, most likely written by Phillip of Opus, demonstrates a transformation of the view of the heaven that soon paved the "western way" for astrology. This dialogue shows the transformation of the planets into visible representations of the Olympian gods, just as the Babylonian planets were images of their pantheon. The older names of the planets encountered in Homer and Hesiod (and in Plato's Republic) designated their appearance rather than divine personification. Jupiter was shining (Phaithon), Mercury was twinkling (Stilbôn), Mars was fiery (Pureos) and Venus was the bright morning star and evening star (Phosphoros and Vesperos). In the Epinomis, the planets are given proper names for Greek gods, though the author leaves open the question of whether the celestial beings are the gods themselves or likenesses fashioned by the gods (theous autous tauta humnêteon orthotata, ê gar theous eikonas hôs agalmata hupolabein gegonenai, theôn autôn ergasamenon, 983e). The new names of planets as Greek gods corresponded loosely with the astral deities of Babylonian astrology, such as the identification of ruling Olympian, Zeus, with the planet Jupiter, replacing the principle Babylonian god Marduk. Ištar (female as evening star, male as morning star) became Aphroditê/Venus, Nergal (god of destruction) Ares/Mars, Nabu Hermes/Mercury, Ninib Kronos/Saturn, and Sin became the female lunar deity Selênê.

The author of Epinomis extends the sentiment of astral piety evident in the Laws, and goes so far as to say that the highest virtue is piety, and that astronomy is the art/science that leads to this virtue (989b-990a) – for it teaches the orderliness of the celestial gods, harmony, and number. While Plato himself would never place the heavenly gods in direct control of a person's destiny, the distinction between the fatalism of such a control measured by astrology and an astral piety that permitted some intervention of gods in human affairs was not sharply drawn. Does the care of the gods for "all things great and small" (epimeloumenoi pantôn, smikrôn kai meizonôn, 980d) mean that it is through their activities or motions they control, guide or occasionally intervene in human matters? While we do not yet see a clear distinction between astral piety and practical astrology, later texts on mystery cults, Gnosticism, Hermeticism, and magic demonstrate that someone who either worships stars, or is concerned with their ontological status, need not be technically proficient in astronomy. Nor must they believe that life is fated by astrally determined necessity. Likewise, the technical Hellenistic astrologers who calculated birth charts and made predictions did not necessarily practice rituals in reverence to planetary gods. While there is no clear evidence for a unified school in which technical astrologers were indoctrinated into both technique and theory of the craft, the fact that the Hellenistic techniques (barring the basic foundation of Babylonian astrology) had developed in a variety of conflicting ways speaks to the possibility of several schools of thought in theory, practice, and perhaps geographic distance. As each astrologer contributed their own techniques or variations on techniques, the technical material quickly multiplied, and students of astrology had many authoritative writers to follow. The most likely scenario is that the practicing astrologers possessed a variety of viewpoints about the life and "influence" of the planets and stars, based on available cosmological views in religion and philosophy. While borrowing freely from Stoic, Pythagorean and Platonic thought, the astrologers who would soon emerge varied theoretically on issues such as which aspects of earthly existence may or may not be subject to Fate and the influence of the stars, and whether or not the soul is affected by celestial motions and relationships.

b. Stoic Cosmic Determinism

Although the founder of Stoicism, Zeno of Citium, integrated fate into the system of physics, the first Stoic to write a treatise On Fate (Peri heimarmenês) is Chrysippus of Soli (280-207 B.C.E.). Xenocrates and Epicurus both penned lost works of the same title prior to his (Diog. Laert., 4.12; 10.28). Given the influence of Xenocrates on the Stoa on matters as important as oikeôisis, there is no reason to think that all of the issues of fate and freedom discussed by Chrysippus originate with him. Later Stoics such as Boethus, Posidonius and Philopator, dedicated works to fate, a topic that would become a critical issue for all Hellenistic schools of thought. The development of Hellenistic astrology is placed in the context of these theories.

i. Fate and Necessity

Stoic theory of fate involves the law of cause and effect, but unlike Epicurean atomism, it is not a purely mechanistic determinism because at the helm is divine reason. Logos, for the Stoics, was the causal principle of fate or destiny. This principle is not simply external to human beings, for it is disseminated through the cosmos as logos spermatikos (seminal reason) which is particularly concentrated in humans who are subordinate partners of the gods. Individual logoi are related to the cosmic logos through living in harmony with nature and the universe. This provided the basis of Stoic ethics, for which there is the goal of eupoia biou or smooth living rather than fighting with the natural and fated order of things. Chrysippus makes a distinction between fate (heimarmenê) and necessity (anankê) in which the former is a totality of antecedent causes to an event, while the latter is the internal nature of a thing, or internal causes. By its nature, a pot made of clay can be shattered, but the actual events of the shattering of a specific pot are due to the sum total of external causes and inner constraints. Fate, in general, encompasses the internal causes, though to be fated does not exclude the autonomy of individuals because particular actions are based on internal considerations such as will and character. Some events are considered to be co-fated by both external circumstances and conscious acts of choice. Diogenianus gives examples of co-fatedness, e.g., the preservation of a coat is co-fated with the owner's care for it, and the act of having children is co-fated with a willingness to have intercourse (Stoicorum veterum fragmenta, 2.998). Character or disposition also plays a part in determining virtue and vice. Polemical writers such as Alexander of Aphrodisias characterize the Stoic position as maintaining that virtue and vice are innate. However, it is more accurate to say that for the Stoics an individual is born morally neutral, though with a natural inclination towards virtue (virtue associated with reason/logos) that can be enhanced through training or corrupted through neglect. Though morally neutral at birth, a human being is not a tabula rasa, but has potentialities which make him more or less receptive to good and bad influences from the environment. An individual cannot act contrary to his or her character, which is a combination of innate and external factors, but there is the possibility of acquiring a different character, as a sudden conversion. Since character determines action the ethical responsibility rests with the most immediate causes. An often cited example is that of a cylinder placed on a hill – the initial and external cause of being pushed down the hill represents the rational order of fate, while its naturally rollable shape represents will and character of the mind (Aulus Gellius, Noctes Atticae, 7.2.11). Cultivation of character through knowledge and training was thought to result in "harmonious acceptance of events" (which are governed by the rational plan of the cosmos), whereas lack of culture results in the errors of pitting oneself against fate (Gellius, 7.2.6).

ii. Stoic-Babylonian Eternal Recurrence

Berossus, a Babylonian priest who settled on the island of Cos and the author of Babuloniakos, is often credited for bringing Babylonian astrology to the Greek-speaking world. Because he is thought to have flourished around 280 B.C.E., he is not the first to expose Greek speakers to this art, but he is known for founding an astronomical and astrological school. Kidinnu and Soudines, two Babylonian astronomers mentioned by second century C.E. Vettius Valens, also contributed to Hellenistic astronomy and astrology. Although many of the technical and theoretical details of pre-Hellenistic Babylonian astrology in Greece are lost in all but a few tablets, the doctrine of apokatastasis or eternal recurrence is attributed to Berossus by Seneca (Quaest. nat., 3.2.1). One scholar of the history of astronomy (P. Schnabel,Berossus und die babylonisch-hellenistische Literatur, Leipzig 1923) argued that Kidinnu possessed a theory of "precession of the equinox" prior to Hipparchus. Precession occurs due to a slight rotation of the earth's axis resulting in a cyclical slippage of the vernal point in reference to the stars. (See section on Ptolemy for more on precession) From this was concluded an eternal recurrence based on the precession of the vernal point through the constellations. Schnabel's theory, however, had been refuted by Neugebauer. Whatever the case may be, it is likely that Babylonian cosmological theories influenced the founding Stoics, particularly Chrysippus.

The early Stoic version of the eternal recurrence is that a great conflagration (ekpurôsis) marks a stage in the cycle of the reconstitution of the cosmos (apokatastasis). One cycle, a Great Year (SVF, 2.599), would last until the planets align in their original position or zodiac sign in the cosmos (SVF, 2.625). Each age would end in Fire, the purest of elements and the irreducible cosmic substance, and would be followed by a restoration of all things. This fire, for the Stoics, was a "craftsmanly fire" (pur tekhnikonidentified with Zeus and of a different nature than the material fire that was one of the four elements. In the reconstitution of the world, the fiery element would interact with air to create moisture, which then condenses into earth. The four elements would then organize in their proper measures to create living beings (SVF, 1.102). By Necessity, the principle cohesive power of the cosmos, the same souls which existed in one cycle would then be reconstituted in the cosmos and would play the same part in the same way, with perhaps an insignificant variation or two. This concept from the early Stoa is sometimes known as the "eternal recurrence." Because human souls are rational seeds of God (Logos, Zeus, Creative Fire), the conflagration is an event in which all souls return to the pure substance of creative fire (pur technikon), Zeus. This is not to be understood as an "afterlife" of human souls, as one would find in Christianity, for example. God, then restored in his own completion, assesses the lives of the previous cycle and fashions the next great age of the world that will contain an identical sequence of events. Heraclitus, whom the Stoics claimed as a precursor, possessed an earlier doctrine of conflagration, though it is not to be assumed that his generation and decay of the cosmos was measured by the planetary circuits, for its movement, to him, is a pathway up and down rather than circular (Diog. Laert., 9. 6). As reported by Philo, the only Stoics to have rejected the eternal recurrence include Boethus of Sidon, Panaetius, and a mature Diogenes of Babylon (De aeternitate mundi, 76-7).

Astrological configurations were specified as part of the Stoic-Babylonian theory of eternal recurrence. According to Nemesius,

The Stoics say that when the planets return to the same celestial sign [sêmeion], in length and breadth [mêkos kai platos], where each was originally when the world was first formed, at the set periods of time they cause conflagration and destruction of existing things. Once again the world returns anew to the same condition as before; and when the stars are moving again in the same way, each thing that occurred in the previous period will come to pass indiscernibly. (SVF, 2.625, tr. Long and Sedley, Hellenistic Philosophers V. 1, p. 309).

The word sêmeion used by Nemesius could represent any celestial indicator, though the typical word for "sign of the zodiac" was zôidion. The celestial position of "length and breath" (latitude and longitude) is more specifically identified by second century C.E. astrologer Antiochus as the last degree of the zodiac sign of Cancer or the first degree of Leo. A variation of this theory of apokatastasis includes anantapokatastatis, which is an additional destruction by water which occurs when the planets align in the opposing sign, Capricorn. Such destruction by a Great Flood during this alignment was also attributed to Berossus by Seneca. Fourth century astrologer turned Christian, Firmicus Maternus, associatedapokatastasis with the Thema Mundi (or Genesis Cosmos), which is a "birth chart" for the world consisting of each planet in the 15th degree of its own sign. For the sake of consistency with the Stoic eternal cosmos, Firmicus claimed this chart does not indicate that the world had any original birth in the sense of creation, particularly one that could be conceived of by human reason or empirical observation. The Great Year contains all possible configurations and events. Because it exceeds the span of human records of observation, there is no way of determining the birth of the world. He claimed that the schema had been invented by the Hermetic astrologers to serve as an instructional tool often employed as allegory (Mathesis, 3.1). A more common Genesis Cosmos mentioned in astrological texts is a configuration of all planets in their own signs and degrees of exaltation hupsoma), special regions that had been established in Babylonian astrology.

iii. Divination and Cosmic Sympathy

The eternal recurrence doctrine in Stoicism entails justification of divination and belief in the predictability of events. The Sun, Moon and planets, as gods, possess the pur technikon and are not destroyed in theekpurôsis (SVF, 1.120). While their physical substance is destroyed, they maintain an existence as thoughts in the mind of Zeus. Because the gods are indestructible, they maintain memory of events that take place within a Great Year and know everything that will happen in the following cycles (SVF, 2.625). Divination, for Stoicism, is therefore possible, and even a divine gift. Stoics who accepted divination include Chrysippus, Diogenes of Babylon, and Antipater (SVF, 2.1192). The presupposition that divination is a legitimate science was also used by Chrysippus as an argument in favor of fate. Cicero, however, argued for the incompatibility of divination and Stoicism (De fato, 11-14), particularly the incompatibility between Chryssipus' modal logical (which allows for non-necessary future truths) and the necessary future claimed by divination's power of prediction. These non-necessary future truths include all things that happen "according to us" (eph' hêmin). The example argument presented by Cicero, "If someone is born at the rising of the Dogstar, he will not die at sea," would not, by his account, fall under the category of non-necessary truths since the antecedent truth is necessary (as a past true condition). Therefore the conclusion would also be necessary according to Chrysippus' logic. Cicero mentions Chrysippus' defense against charges of such contradictions, but regardless of the success or failure of Chysippus' defense against them, the issue for the possibility of divination, for the Stoics, was not considered a logical contradiction between fate and free will. The eph hêmin in Stoicism was based on a disposition of character that, while not a causal necessity, would lead one to make decisions between the good, bad, and indifferent in accordance with nature. Because human beings are by nature the rational seeds (logoi spermatikoi) of the Godhead, their choices will correspond to the cosmic fate inherent in the eternal recurrence, and would not alter that which is divined. For Chrysippus, at least, the laws of divination are accepted as empirically factual (or proto-science) and not as a matter of logicalconnectivity between past, present, and future. Since divination occurs as a matter of revelation thoughsigns, the idea that there can be knowledge of a necessary causal antecedent leading to a future effect is not the principle behind it (cf. Bobzein, p. 161-170). The Stoic argument for divination through signs would be as follows: if there are gods, they must both be aware of future events and must love human beings while holding only good intentions toward them. Because of their care for human beings, signs are then given by the gods for potential knowledge of future events. These events are known by the gods, though not alterable by them. If signs are given, then the proper means to interpret them must also be given. If they are not interpreted correctly, the fault does not lie with the gods or with divination itself, but with an error of judgment on the part of the interpreter (Cicero, De divinatione, 1.82-3; 1.117-18).

Another theory in support of divination and by extension astral divination, is that of cosmic sympathy. Cosmic sympathy was already prevalent in Hipparchean medical theory, though Posidonius is credited for its development in the Stoic school. Posidonius, though, claimed to have drawn this notion from Democritus, Xenophanes, Pythagoras and Socrates. Stoic physical theory holds that all things in the universe are connected and held together in their interactions through tension. The active and passive principles move pneuma, the substance that penetrates and unifies all things. In fact, this tension holds bodies together, and every coherent thing would collapse without it. Pneuma as the commanding substance of the soul penetrates the cosmos. This cosmos, for the Stoics, is both a rational and sensate living being (Diog. Laert., 7.143). The Stoics thought that the cosmos is ensouled and has impulses or desires (hormai). Whereas in Platonism these impulses are conflicting and need the rational part of the soul to govern them, in Stoicism desires of the cosmic soul are harmoniously drawn toward a rational (though not entirely accessible to human beings) end, which is Logos, or Zeus' return to himself through the cosmic cycle of apokatastasis. So the idea of cosmic sympathy supports divination, because knowledge of one part of the cosmos (such as a sign) is, by way of the cohesive substance of pneuma, access to the whole. In contrast to Plato's disparaging view of divination that it is not divinely inspired but based on the artless fumbling of human error, the Stoic view, for the most part, is that rational means of divination can be developed. The push to develop a scientific (meaning systematic and empirical) knowledge-based divination finds its natural progression in mathematically based astrology.

Stoic-influenced astrologers went a step further than Stoic philosophers to define innate potentials of character by assigning them to the zodiac and planets. Virtuous and corrupt characteristics are identified as determined by the potential of the natal chart, while external circumstances are indicated by the combination of this chart with transits of planets through time and certain periods of life set in motion by the configurations in the natal chart. For instance, in his list of personality characteristics for individuals born with certain zodiac signs on the horizon, Teukros of Babylon (near Cairo) includes character traits that are not morally neutral. For example, those born when the first decan of Libra is ascending are "virtuous" (enaretous), while those born when the third decan of Scorpio is ascending "do many wrongs" or are "law-breakers" (pollous adikountas).

iv. The Attitude of Stoic Philosophers Towards Astrology

While it is clear that Stoic philosophy influenced the development of astrology, the attitude of the Stoa towards astrology, however, varied on the basis of the individual philosophers. Cicero stated that Diogenes of Babylon believed astrologers are capable of predicting disposition and praxis (one's life activity), but not much else. Diogenes, though, is said to have calculated a "Great Year" in his earlier years (Aetius, De placitis reliquiae, 364.7-10). His turn to skepticism changed his view on Stoic ekpurosisand likely modified his view on astrology. Middle Stoic Panaetius is said to have rejected astrology altogether. That an astrological example is used by Cicero to illustrate a contradiction in Chrysippus' logic and divination does not necessarily mean that Chrysippus himself had much exposure to or took an interest in astrology. (Cicero's example is, "If someone is born at the rising of the Dogstar, he will not die at sea." Si quis (verbi causa) oriente Canicula natus est, is in mari non morietur. De fato, 12). In Chrysippus' time, Hellenistic astrology had not yet been formulated systematically. However, given that the example is based on a consideration of importance to Babylonian astrology, the rising of the fixed star Sirius, the possibility exists that Chrysippus or one of his contemporaries discussed astrology in the context of logic and divination.

Posidonius was alleged by Augustine to have been "much given to astrology" (multum astrologiae deditus) and "an assertor fatal influence of the stars" (De civitate dei 5.2). His actual relationship to astrology, however, is more complicated, but there are several reasons to think that he supported astrology. For one, in his belief that the world is a living animal, he followed Chrysippus in identifying the commanding faculty of the world soul as the heavens (Diog. Laert., 7.138-9. Cleanthes considered it to be the Sun). Secondly, Posidonius had a strong research interest in astronomy and meteorology. He was the first to systematically research the connection between ocean tides and the phases of the Moon. His research in this area possibly led him to his doctrine of cosmic sympathy, as he considered natural affinities among things of the earth. Cosmic sympathy allows for an association between signs (within nature that can extend to planets and stars) and future events without direct causality. If the higher faculty of the cosmos is located in the heavens, then it is more likely that these signs would carry weight for Posidonius. Thirdly, Cicero, who can be given more credibility than Augustine by having attended Posidonius' lectures, mentions him in connection with astrology in De divinatione (1.130). Fourthly, Posidonius (as a Platonic-influenced thinker) believed idea that the signs of the zodiac (zôdia) are ensouled bodies - living beings (Fr. 149, Edelstein-Kidd / Fr. 400a, Theiler). However, given that Posidonius is flourishing at the same time as the earliest textual evidence for Hellenistic astrology (first century B.C.E.; some "technical" Hermetic fragments about Solar and Lunar observations may be earlier), it is difficult to say what type of astrology he would have had an interest in – whether it had been remnants of the Babylonian omen-based astrology, or the beginning formulation of a systematic Greco-Roman astrology. Because he was widely traveled, he may have gained exposure to one or more astrologers or schools of astrologers. With his observations of the connection between seasonal fluctuations of the tides and the Solar/Lunar cycles, he apparently refuted Seleucus, a Babylonian astronomer who believed that the tides also fluctuation according to the zodiac sign in which the Moon would fall; he claimed the tides were regular when the Moon would be in the equinoctial signs of Aries or Libra and irregular in the solstitial signs of Capricorn, Cancer (Fr. 218, Edelstein-Kidd / Fr. 26, Theiler). This observation would not have necessarily been considered an astrological one, though it is schematized according to characteristics of the zodiac rather than lunations and seasons, and such schematizations were quite common in Hellenistic astrology. It cannot be said with certainty whether Posidonius' advocacy of cosmic sympathy lent support to the development of astrology or if this development itself reinforced Posidonius' own theories of cosmic sympathy and fate.

The importance of astrology in politics of first century Rome was aided by its alignment with Stoic fatalism and cosmic sympathy. Balbillus, son of Thrasyllus and astrologer to Nero, Seneca, and a certain Alexandrian Stoic, Chaeremon, were all appointed tutors to L. Domitius. Chaeremon (who Cramer, p. 116, identifies with the Egyptian priest/astrology in Porphyry's Letter to Anebo and in Eusebius'Praeparatio evang., 4.1) wrote a work on comets (peri komêtôn suggramma) that cast these typically foreboding signs in a favorable light. Seneca, too, wrote a work on comets (Book 7 of Quaestiones naturales), in which he portrays some as good omens for the Empire (cf. Cramer, p. 116-118).

c. Middle Platonic and Neopythagorean Developments

So far in this account of the theoretical development of Hellenistic astrology, the pre-Socratic thinkers contributed a deep concern for fate and justice. Plato contributed an orderly and rational cosmos, while those in the early Academy displayed an astral piety that recognized the planets as gods or representations of gods. The Stoics contributed theories of fate and divination, that already had an astrological component with the Babylonian contribution to the Eternal Recurrence. Cosmic sympathy, present in Greek medicine and popularized by the middle Stoic Posidonius, provided astrologers with a theoretical grounding for the associations among planets, zodiac signs, and all other things. One notable Stoic contribution to Hellenistic astrology which distinguishes it from the Babylonian is the incorporation of Chryssipus' principle of two forces, active and passive, manifest in the activities of the four elements. Fire and air were active, earth and water passive. The astrologers later assigned these elements and dynamic qualities to each sign of the zodiac. Further philosophical developments by the Middle Platonists and the Neopythagoreans would then lead to astrology as a system of knowledge due to its systematic and mathematical nature. The systematic nature would make it plausible to some and a worthy or dangerous foe to others. These developments set astrology apart, epistemologically speaking, from other manners of divination such as haruspicy (study of the liver of animals), or dream interpretation.

The union between Pythagorean theory and Platonism should come as no surprise given Plato's late interest in Pythagoreanism. From the early academy onward, elements of Pythagorean theory became part and parcel of Platonism. Speusippus wrote a work on Pythagorean numbers (Fr. 4), and he would become influential in this regard, if not as directly on subsequent Academy members as on Neopythagorean circles. He and Xenocrates both offered cosmic hierarchies formed from the One and the Dyad. The One, or Monad, is a principle of order and unity, while the Dyad is the principle of change, motion, and division. The manner in which these principles are related was a critical issue inherited from the early Academy. Xenocrates (Fr. 15) believed that stars are fiery Olympian Gods and in the existence of sublunary daimons and elemental spirits. We see in Xenocrates both the identification of Gods with stars (as we saw in Phillip of Opus) and the notion that Gods are forces of Nature, thereby creating an important theoretical issue for astrology, namely what is the domain of influence of the planetary gods, as the Olympians are identified with the planets. He also believed that the world soul is formed from Monad and Dyad, and that it served as a boundary between the supralunary and sublunary places. Xenocrates' cosmology would be highly influential on Plutarch, who elaborated on the roles of the world soul, the daimons, the planets and fixed stars.

The middle Platonists, many of whom believed themselves to be true expounders of Plato, were influenced by other schools of thought. The physical theories of Antiochus of Ascalon are very Stoic in nature. For example, he incorporated the Stoic "qualities" (poiotêtes), which were moving vibrations that act upon infinitely divisible matter, into his cosmology. The unity of things is held together by the world soul (much as it is held together in Stoic theory by pneuma). Antiochus equated the Stoic Logos/Zeus with the Platonic World Soul, and this soul of the cosmos governs both the heavenly bodies and things on earth that affect humankind. He also accepted the Stoic Pur Tekhnikon (Creative Fire) as the substance composing the stars, gods, and everything else. There is little to indicate that Antiochus held in his cosmology the notion common to some other Platonists of transcendent immateriality; his universe, like the Stoics, is material. On the subject of fate and free will, he argues against Chrysippus (if he is in fact the philosopher identified as doing so in Cicero's De fato and Topica) by accepting the reality of free will rather than the illusion of free will created simply by the limitations of human knowledge in grasping fated future events. Antiochus' view on other beings in the cosmos, particularly the ontological status of stars and planets, may be found in his Roman student Varro who stated that the heavens, populated by souls (the immortal occupying aether and air), are divided by elements in this order from top to bottom: aether, air, water, earth.

From the highest circle of heaven to the circle of the Moon are aetherial souls, the stars and planets, and these are not only known by our intelligence to exist, but are also visible to our eyes as heavenly gods." (from Natural Theology, tr. Dillon, Middle Platonists, p. 90).

Daimons and heroes, then, were thought to occupy the aerial sphere. The importance of Antiochus for the development of Hellenistic astrology may be his break with the skepticism of the New Academy, one which allowed the Middle Platonists to espouse more theological and speculative views about the soul and the cosmos while anticipating Neoplatonic theories. In Alexandria, which, not by coincidence would become a hotbed for astrological theory and practice, Platonism incorporated strong Neopythagorean elements. Eudorus of Alexandria, who wrote a commentary on Plato's Timaeus, contributed to the importance of Timaean cosmology in middle and Neoplatonic thought. References to Eudorus' are found in Achilles' work, Introduction to Aratus' Phenemona. Achille used Eudorus as a source for this work that also contains references to Pythagorean theories of planetary harmonies. We know from Achilles that Eudorus followed the Platonic and Stoic belief that the stars are ensouled living beings (Isagoga, 13). This intellectual climate is likely the immediate context for the development of systematic astrology – with its complex classifications of the signs, planets, and their placements in a horoscope, and the numerological calculations used for predicting all sorts of events in one's life.

i. Ocellus Lucanus

The revival of Pythagoreanism by the mid-first century B.C.E. brought about the acceptance of pythagorica of "Timaeus of Locri" and Ocellus Lucanus as genuinely "early" Pre-Platonic Pythagorean texts, though both mostly like date around the second century B.C.E., or at latest, the first half of the first century B.C.E. The Neopythagorean texts just mentioned are significant for the development of Hellenistic astrology. They represent cosmological theories that likely were used as justification for astrology.

In On the Nature of the Universe (peri tês tou pantos phuseôs), Ocellus argues for a perfectly ordered harmonious universe that is immutable and unbegotten. By appealing to the empirical rationale that we cannot perceive the universe coming to be and passing away, but only its self-identity, he concludes the eternity of the whole, including its part. This whole though is divided into two worlds, the supralunary and the sublunary. The heavens down to the Moon comprise a world of unchanging harmony that governs the sublunary realm of all changing and corruptible activity. In Platonic manner, the unchanging (the Monad) governs and generates the changing (the Dyad). In Pythagorean manner, the divine beings in the unchanging realm are in perfect harmony with one another through their regular motions. Visible signs for the unchanging harmony and self-subsistence of the universe are found in the harmonious movements of things in relation to one another. Based on the nature of the relations listed - "order, symmetry, figurations (skhêmatismoi), positions (theseis), intervals (diastaseis), powers, swiftness and slowness with respect to others, their numbers and temporal periods" (1.6) - he clearly means the movements of planets and stars. This list comprises the primary factors by which astrologers would assess the strength and qualities of planets in a given horoscope as the basis for the formulation of predictive techniques and statements. For instance, swiftness of planets was thought to make them stronger while slowness (which occurs close to the retrogradation motion) weakens the planet, while "figurations" (skhêmatismoi) is a word used for aspects, or the geometrical figures planets make to one another and the ascending sign (horoskopos). Temporal periods were assigned by astrologers in a variety of ways, though usually based on the "lesser years" of the planets, the time it took for one planet to complete its revolution with respect to a starting point in the zodiac. "Intervals" (diastaseis) were measures that were calculated either between planets or between planets and the horizon or culminating points in a horoscope; in the case of the latter, the intervals were used in astrology to determine strong and weak areas in the horoscope. The former notion of intervals was used for determining various time periods of one's life assigned to each planet (cf. Valens, Anthologiarum, 3.3). "Numbers" was a term used to indicate a planet's motion (as appearing from earth) as direct or retrograde. "Powers" (dunameis) of the planets are combinations of heating, cooling, drying, moistening – these powers made planets benevolent or malevolent (cf. Ptolemy, Tetrabiblos, 1.4). Ocellus goes on to name these powers as hot, cold, wet, and dry, and he contrasts them with the "substances" (ousiai) or elements of fire, earth, water and air. The powers and substances, or "qualities" and "elements" as they are more commonly called, were used in horoscopic astrology to describe the natures of the planets and zodiac signs. In Ocellus' explanation of astral causality, the powers are immortal forms that affect changes on the sublunary substances (2.4-5).

Whether or not Ocellus and other Neopythagoreans are at the forefront of formulating these particular astrological rules, he provides a metaphysical basis for the notion that the planets and stars effect changes on earth. He is further described as saying that the Moon is the locus where immortality (above) and mortality (below) meet. He also says the obliquity of the zodiac, the pathway of the Sun, is the inclining place at which the supralunary generates activity in the sublunary realm. The Sun's seasonal motion conforms to the powers (hot, cold, wet, and dry) that bring about changes in the substances (elements); the ecliptic path inclines these powers into the realm of strife and nature.

In his discussion on the generation of men, Ocellus argues, in more of an Aristotelian than Platonic sense (as found in On Generation and Corruption, that the only participation of men in immortality is through the gift by divinities of the power of reproduction. Following rules of morality in connubial relations results in living in harmony with the universe. Immoral transgressions, though, are punished by the production of ignoble offspring. A manner of cosmic sympathy (as found in Greek medicine) plays a role in determining that the circumstances of conception (such as a tranquil state of mind) will reflect upon the nature of the offspring. This notion is in keeping with the fact that astrologers studied charts not only for the moment of birth, but for conception as well. The only major difference is that for the astrologers, the circumstances of the birth appear to be reflected universally at a given time and not the direct result of moral or immoral actions as it is for Ocellus. The moment of birth or conception for the astrologers is reflected in all things of nature and in any activities initiated at that particular moment, as reflected in the positions of the planets and signs. The technical astrologers typically did not include reflections on moral retributions in their manuals of astral fate. They were primarily concerned with detailing knowledge of fate for its own sake, though speculation about such matters as retribution and rebirth is not excluded by astrological theory.

ii. Timaeus Locrus

The Hellenistic text attributed to Timaeus Locrus, On the Nature of the World and the Soul, purports to be the original upon which Plato drew for his dialogue of his name. For the most part, it consists of a summary of the material by Plato. The circles of the Same and the Different carry the fixed stars and the planets respectively. The sphere of the fixed stars containing the cosmos is granted the Pythagorean perfect figure of the dodecahedron. One addition of note for the theory of astrology is the doctrine of the creation of souls. The four elements are made by the demiurge in equal measure and power, and Soul of man is made in the same proportion and power. Individual souls of human beings are fashioned by Nature (who has been handed the task by the demiurge of creating mortal beings) from the Sun, Moon, and planets, from the circle of Difference with a measure of the circle of the Same that she (Nature being hypostasized as the female principle) mixes in the rational part of the soul. There appears in this to be a difference in individual souls reflecting different fates based on the composition. While this merely reiterates what is found in Plato's Timaeus (42d-e), the supposition that one could read this account straight from Timaeus Locrus gave authority to these notions. It is likely that these ideas filtered to the astrologers, who would devise methods for seeking out the ruling planet (oikodespotês) for an individual (see section on Porphyry). Perhaps what they were seeking in the horoscope was one of the "young gods" whose task it was to fashion the mortal body of each soul and to steer their course away from evils. As mentioned above, some philosophers associated the young gods with the planets.

Astrological fragments of a writer "Timaeus Praxidas" date to the same period (early to middle first century B.C.E.), but there is little textual evidence to indicate that these are one and the same writer. What it at least indicates is that the legend of Timaeus lent authority to the astrological writers.

iii. Thrasyllus

Thrasyllus (d. 36 C.E.), a native of Alexandria, was not only the court astrologer to Tiberius, but a grammarian and self-professed Pythagorean who studied in Rhodes. Given that he published an edition of Plato's works (and is known for the arrangement of the dialogues into tetralogies), and that he wrote a work on Platonic and Pythagorean philosophy, we can assume that his astrological theory represents Middle Platonism of the early first century C.E. However, a summary of his astrological work "Pinax" (tables), indicates that he is drawing upon earlier sources, particularly the pseudepigrapha of "Nechepso and Petosiris" and Hermes Trismegistus. A numerological table, perhaps containing zodiac associations to numbers as that found in Teukros of Babylon, is also attributed to Thrasyllus. It appears that his own philosophy contains a mixture of Hermetic and Pythagorean elements.

A search for exact origins of astrology's development into a complex system remains inconclusive, but the following can be surmised. The combination of Pythagorean theory, such as the supralunary realm influencing the sublunar, Platonic ensouled planets moving on the circle of the Different, Stoic determinism and cosmic sympathy, and the emergence of a Hermetic tradition, comprised the intellectual context for the systematic structuring of astrology, its classifications of the signs, planets, and their placements in a horoscope, and the numerological calculations used for predicting all sorts of events in one's life.

iv. Plutarch

Besides being a prolific writer on a variety of subjects, Plutarch was, philosophically speaking, a Platonist, as defined by his era, that is, one influenced by Aristotelian, Stoic, and Neopythagorean notions. In Plutarch's case this includes ideas culled from his study of Persian and Egyptian traditions. By his time (late first century C.E.), astrology had been systematized and appropriated by Greek language and thinking, and in Rome, the political implications of astrological theory were made evident in the relationships between astrologers and emperors (such as Thrasyllus and his son Balbillus) and in the edicts against predictions about emperors (cf. Cramer, 99 ff). Plutarch's own form of Platonism did not then directly contribute to the technical development of astrology, but it does add a Middle Platonic contribution to an explanation of how astrology gained some credibility and much popularity in the first three centuries of the common era. He also borrowed some astrological concepts (and metaphors) for his own philosophy. First of all, as a priest of Apollo, Plutarch saw all other deities as symbolic aspects of One God that is invisible and unintelligible. He gained impetus for this from an etymology of "Apollo," which is explained as an alpha-privative a-pollos, or "not many" (De E apud Delphos, 393b). He resists a pure identification of the Sun with Apollo (De pythiae oraculis 400c-d), because the One God is Invisible, and the Sun an intelligible copy. He likens the Sun to one aspect, that of the Nous, the heart of the cosmos. The Moon is then associated with the cosmic Soul (and spleen), and the earth with the bowels. Taking cue from Plato's suggestion in the Laws (10.896 ff) of two world souls, beneficent and malevolent (a concept Numenius would take up later), he believed the malevolent soul to be responsible for irrational motion in the sublunary world. The malevolent or irrational soul preexisted the demiurge's creation. It is not pure evil, but the cause of evil operating in the sublunary realm, mixing with the good to create cosmic tension. Plutarch maintains the distinction of Ocellus between the generating supralunary realm and the generated sublunary realm, but he offers more detail about operations in the sublunary world of change. He posits two opposing principles or powers of good and evil that offer a right-handed straight path and a reversed, backwards path for souls (De Isis., 369e). Individual souls are microcosms of a world soul (based on Timaeus, 30b), and the parts of the soul reflect this cosmic tension. Souls are subject in the sublunary realm to a mixture of fate (heimarmenê), chance (tukhê), and free choice (eph' hêmin). The "young gods", the planetary gods in the Timaeus (42d-e) that steer souls, Plutarch designates as the province of the irrational soul. With the emphasis of the irrational soul and the mixture of forces in the sublunary realm, Plutarch's cosmology allows for the possibility of astrology. Plutarch also posits four principles (arkhê) in the cosmos, Life, Motion, Generation and Decay (De genio Socratis, 591b). Life is linked to Motion through the activity of the Invisible, through the Monad; Motion is linked to Generation through the Mind (Nous); and Generation is linked to Decay through the Soul. The three Fates (Moirai) are also linked to this cycle as Clotho seated in the Sun presided over the first process, Atropo, seated in the Moon, over the second, and Lachesis over the third on Earth (cf. De facie in orbe lunae, 945c-d). At death the soul of a person leaves the body and goes to Moon, the mind leaves the soul and goes to Sun. The reverse process happens at birth. Plutarch is not rigid with his use of planetary symbolism, for in another place, he associates the Sun with the demiurge, and the young gods with the Moon, emphasizing the rational and irrational souls (De E apud Delphos, 393a).

Plutarch's own opinion about astrology as a practice of prediction is ambiguous at best. He supported the probability of divination by human beings, although dimmed by the interference of the body, as evident in his arguments for it in On the E at Delphi (387) and in De defectu oraculorum (431e ff). However, he complains about generals who rely more heavily on divination than on counselors experienced in military affairs (Marius, 42.8). In his accounts of astrologers, his attitude appears to be more skeptical. InRomulus (12), he discusses the claims made by an astrologer named Taroutios, namely, of discovering the exact birth date and hour of Romulus as well as the time in which he lay the first stone of his city, by working backwards from his character to his birth chart. Plutarch considered astrologers' claims that cities are subject to fate accessible by a chart cast for the beginning of their foundation to be extravagant. He also wrote about how Sulla, having consulted Chaldaeans, was able to foretell his own death in his memoirs (Sulla, 37.1). However, Plutarch finds himself at a loss at explaining why Marius would be successful in his reliance on divination while Octavius was not so fortunate accepting the forecasts of Chaldaeans.

4. The Astrologers

a. The Earliest Hellenistic Astrology: Horoscopic and Katarchic

Cicero's account in On Divination of Eudoxus' rejection of Chaldaean astrological predictions points to Greek awareness of Babylonian astrology as early as the third century B.C.E. Another account about Theophrastus' awareness of Chaldaean horoscopic astrology (predicting for individuals rather than weather and general events) is given to us by Proclus (In Platonis Timaeum commentaria, 3.151). Technical manuals by Greek-speaking astrologers used for casting and interpreting horoscopic (natal) charts date as early as the late second century B.C.E. In addition to natal astrology, many of the fragments exemplify the practice of katarchical astrology, or the selection of the most auspicious moment for a given activity. Katarkhê was also used to ascertain events that had already happened, to view the course of an illness, or track down thieves, lost objects, and runaway slaves. Fragments attributed to Thrasyllus, the philosopher-astrology include such methods. This use of astrology implies that the astrologers themselves did not prescribe to strict fatalism, at least the kind that dictates that knowledge from signs of the heavens cannot influence events. Perhaps like Plutarch, they believed in a combination of fate, chance, and free will. Given the pervasiveness of cosmic sympathy and a unified cosmic order, astrology pertaining to proper moments of time and to natural occurrences was less controversial than that pertaining to the soul of human beings. However, the texts of the next few centuries focus primarily on natal rather than katarchic astrology. Methods to ascertain controversial matters such as one's length of life would proliferate and play a significant part in Roman politics (cf. Cramer, p. 58 ff). Such fascination with either the fate or predisposition of individuals reflects a stronger concern in the late Hellenistic world for the life of the individual in a period of rapid political and social change.

b. Earliest Fragments and Texts

The earliest Hermetic writings, the technical Hermetica (dated second century B.C.E. and contrasted with philosophical Hermetica cf. Fowden, p. 58) include works on astrology. As mentioned by Clement, (Stromata, 6.4.35-7), they include: on the ordering of the fixed stars, on the Sun, Moon and five planets, on the conjunctions and phases of the Sun and Moon, and on the times when the stars rise. These topics in the early Hermetica do not reflect much technical sophistication in comparison to the complicated techniques of prediction that we find in the katarchic and natal astrology texts of other astrological writers. The astronomical measurements that appear to be used for these topics are most likely for the purpose of katarchic astrology and ritual because they do not contain the apparatus for casting natal charts. An exception to the technical sparsity of astrology considered to be in the lineage of Hermes Trismegistus are the works attributed to Nechepso and Petosiris (typically dated around 150 B.C.E.), portions of which survive in quotations. Combined, they are considered a major source for many later astrologers, and are said by Firmicus Maternus to be in line with the Hermetic tradition, handed down by way of other Hermetic figures such as Aesclepius and Anubio, from Hermes himself. It is impossible to say to what extent the writers of these texts had organized existing techniques or invented new ones, but based on the frequency with which Nechepso and Petosiris are quoted by later authors, we can be certain that they were important conveyers of technical Hellenistic astrology. More about the astral theories in the later philosophical Hermeticism and Gnosticism will be discussed below.

Additional fragments are preserved of real and pseudepigraphical astrologers of the first centuries B.C.E and C.E. including Critodemus, Dorotheus of Sidon, Teukros of Babylon, (pseudo-)Eudoxus, Serapion, Orpheus, Timaeus Praxidas, Anubion, (pseudo-)Erasistratus, Thrasyllus, and Manilius. Only a few representative writers will be highlighted below.

c. Manilius

For most of the early astrological writers, we can only speculate about their theoretical justification for the practice, two exceptions being first century B.C.E. Roman Stoic Manilius, (from whom we have the Latin didactic poem, Astronomica), and Thrasyllus, whose work is described above. Manilius was also associated with the Roman imperial circle, dedicating his work to either Augustus or Tiberius (see Cramer, p. 96, for more on this controversy). While his poetic account of astrology contains much technical material, there is little evidence to show that he himself practiced astrological prediction. Some scholars speculated that he intended to avoid the political dangers of the practice in his day with the poetic writing style and the exclusion of astrological doctrine about the planets, which is necessary for the practice (or his work could simply be incomplete). His Stoic philosophy is one in which Fate is immutable, and astrology is a means of understanding the cosmic and natural order of all things, but not of changing events. However fated we are, he says, is no excuse for bad behavior such as crime, for crime is still wicked and punishable no matter what its origin in the sequence of causal determinism (4.110-117). He used the regularity of the rising of the fixed stars and the courses of the Sun and Moon as proof against the Epicureans that nothing is left to chance and that the universe is commanded by a divine will (1.483-531). Nature apportions to the stars the responsibility over the destinies of individuals (3.47-58). Nature is not thought to be separate from reason, but is the agent of Fate – one orchestrated by a material god for reasons not readily accessible to the mortals who experience apparent injustices and turns of events that defy normal expectations (4.69-86). The purpose of the deity is simply to maintain order and harmony in its cosmos (1.250-254). Astrology demonstrates cosmic sympathy among all things and can be used to predict events insofar as it grants access to the predestined order. In addition to the use of astrology for psychological acceptance of one's fate, Manilius emphasizes the aesthetic and religious benefits of its study, for he considers it a gift to mortals from the god Hermes for the sake of inducing reverence and piety of the cosmic deity.

d. Claudius Ptolemy of Alexandria

Astrology had increased in popularity in the second century C.E., and two writers of this period operating under different philosophical influences, Ptolemy (c. 100-170 C.E.) and Vettius Valens (fl. 152-162 C.E.), will next be discussed. Ptolemy is an exception among the astrological authors because first and foremost he is an empirical scientist, and one who, like his philosophical and scientific contemporaries, is concerned with theories of knowledge. His works include those on astronomy, epistemology, music, geography, optics, and astrology. He is best known as an astronomer for his work Syntaxis mathematica (Almagest), but from the middle ages to present day, his astrological work,Apotelesmatica (or Tetrabiblos as it is more commonly known), has been considered the key representative of Greek astrology, primarily due to its prominence in textual transmission.

Scholars have claimed Ptolemy's main philosophical influences to be either Peripatetic, Middle Stoic (Posidonius), Middle Platonist (Albinus) or Skeptic (sharing a possible connection with Sextus Empiricus). Any attempts to tie him to a single school would be futile. His eclecticism, though, is by no means an arbitrary amalgam of different schools, but a search for agreements (rather than disagreements sought by the Pyrrhonian Skeptics) and a scientist's harmony of rationalism and empiricism (cf. Long in Dillon & Long, p. 206-207). His epistemological criteria (in On the Criterion shows only superficial differences with the Skeptics, while he often employs Stoic terminology (such as katalêpsis) without the Stoic technical meanings. He extends the Stoic notion of oikeiôsis (as the manner of familiarity that a Stoic Sage achieves with the cosmos) to the relations of familiarity that planets and zodiac signs share among themselves.

Because Ptolemy deviates significantly from other astrologers in theory and technique, some have doubted that he was a practicing astrologer at all. It is difficult to support this claim when in theTetrabiblos he makes a long argument in favor of astrology and he claims to have better methods than offered by the tradition. It seems best to call him a "revisionist" rather than a "non-astrologer." His revisions and causal language make his position vulnerable to later attacks by Plotinus and other philosophers. The methods Ptolemy rejects include material that can be traced to the Hermetic Nechepso/Petosiris text, particularly the use of Lots (klêroi) and the division of the chart into twelve places (topoi) responsible for topics in life such as siblings, illness, travel, etc. Lots were points in the chart typically calculated from the positions of two planets and the degree of the ascending sign. He also rejects various subdivisions of the zodiac and nearly all numerologically based methods. He considered these methods to be disreputable and arbitrary because they are removed from the actual observations of planets and stars. (It might be noted here that he also rejects Pythagorean musicology on empirical grounds in his work Harmonica).

Ptolemy says, in the beginning of Book I, that the study of the relations of the planets and stars to one another (astronomy) can be used for the less perfect art of prediction based on the changes of the things they "surround" (tôn emperiekhomenon). He notes that the difficulty of the art of astrological prediction has made critics believe it to be useless, and he argues in favor of its helpfulness and usefulness. He blames bad and false practitioners for the failing of astrology. The rest of the argument involves the natural cosmic sympathy popularized by Posidonius. The influence of the Sun, Moon, and stars on natural phenomena, weather and seasons brings the possibility than men can likewise be affected in temperament due to this natural ambience (ton periekhon). The surrounding conditions of the time and place of birth contribute a factor to character and temperament (as we find earlier in Ocellus). While the supralunary movements are perfect and destined, the sublunary are imperfect, changeable, and subject to additional causes. Natural events such as weather and seasons are less complicated by additional causes than events in the lives of human beings. Rearing, custom, and culture are additional accidental causes that contribute to the destiny of an individual. He seems to encourage critics to allow astrologers to start their predictions with knowledge of these factors rather than do what is called a "cold reading" in modern astrology. The criticism he counters is that of Skeptics such as Sextus Empiricus, who elaborated on earlier arguments from the New Academy, and who argue that an astrologer does not know if they are making predictions for a human or a pack-ass (Adversus mathematicos, 5.94).

Ptolemy's arguments that astrology is useful and beneficial are the following: 1) One gains knowledge of things human and divine. This is knowledge for its own sake rather than for the purpose of gains such as wealth or fame. 2) Foreknowledge calms the soul. This is a basic argument from Stoic ethics. 3) One can see through this study that there are other causes than divine necessity. Bodies in the heavens are destined and regular, but on earth are changeable in spite of receiving "first causes" from above. This corresponds again to the Neopythagorean Platonism found in Ocellus. These first causes can override secondary causes and can subsume the fate of an individual in the cases of natural disasters. Ptolemy's attribution of the nature of planets and stars, which is the basis of their benefic or malefic nature, is that, like Ocellus before him, of heating, drying, moistening, and cooling. The stars in each sign have these qualities too based on their familiarity (oikeiôsis) with the planets. Geometrical aspects between signs, which are the basis of planetary relations, are also based on "familiarity" determined by music theory and the masculine or feminine assignment to the signs. He considers the sextile and trine aspects to be harmonious, and the quadrangle and opposition to be disharmonious.

Book 2 of Tetrabiblos includes material on astrological significations for weather, ethnology and astro-chorography. Ptolemy is not the first to delineate an astrological chorography (geographical regions assigned to signs of the zodiac), and his assignments differ significantly from those found in Dorotheus, Teukros, Manilius, and Paulus Alexandrinus. Book 3 and 4 consist of methods of prediction of various topics in natal astrology. Absent in his work is the katarchical astrology found in earlier writers. Ptolemy is the first astrologer to employ Hipparchus' zodiac modified to account for the "precession of the equinox," that is, the changing seasonal reference point against the background of the stars. This zodiac uses the vernal equinox as the beginning point rather than the beginning of one of the twelve constellations. (This "tropical" zodiac would become the standard in the Western practice of astrology up to present day. Modern opponents of astrology typically utilize precession – pointing out the fact that zodiac "signs" no longer match with the star constellations.) Other astrologers, including those shortly following Ptolemy, were either not aware of Hipparchus' observation or did not find it important to make this adjustment. Valens claims to use another method of Hipparchus, but it is debatable whether or not he adjusted his zodiac to the vernal point. Ptolemy had no impact on other astrologers of the second century, likely because his texts were not yet in circulation.

We do not find in Ptolemy's work the language of signs and astral divination, but a causal language – the relationships between the planets cause natural activity on earth, from weather to seasons to human temperament. However, Ptolemy argues for the fallibility of prediction, and cannot be considered a strict astral determinist for this reason, though he believed that astrology as a tool of knowledge could be made more accurate with improved techniques, closing the gap of fallibility. The idea that stars are causes is not original with Ptolemy, being an acceptable idea to Peripatetic thinkers cued by Aristotle's eternal circular motions of the heavens as the cause of perpetual generation (On Generation and Corruption (336b15 ff). For Ptolemy, though, this idea as a justification for the practice of astrology was probably filtered through the Peripatetic influenced Neopythagoreans such as Ocellus. Ptolemy's arguments may have been the target of subsequent attacks by Alexander of Aphrodisias, Plotinus and early Church Fathers.

e. Vettius Valens

The work Anthologiarum of Vettius Valens the Antiochian (written between 152-162 C.E.) is important for a number of reasons. It contains fragments of earlier writers such as Nechepso and Critodemus, and numerous horoscopes important for the study of the history of astronomy. He is also an astrological writer who best exemplifies the details of the practice and the mind of the practitioner. Having traveled widely in search of teachers, he exhibits techniques unavailable in other astrological texts, indicating much regional variety. Among his sources, he mentions the following astrologers and astronomers (in alphabetical order): Abram, Apollinarius, Aristarchus, Asclation, Asclepius, Critodemus, Euctemon, Hermeias, Hermes, Hermippus, Hipparchus, Hypsicles, Kidenas, Meton, Nechepso, Petosiris, Phillip, Orion, Seuthes and Soudines, Thrasyllus, Timaeus, Zoroaster. Valens claimed to have tested the methods and to have the advantage of making judgments about the methods through much toil and experience (cf. 6.9). He occasionally interjects the technical material with reflections about his philosophical convictions. His philosophical leaning is far less complicated than Ptolemy's, for it is primarily based on Stoic ethics. His association of the Sun with Nous (1.1), for example, exhibits remnants of the Neopythagorean/Middle Platonic roots (see Plutarch), but his conscious justification for astrology is based on Stoicism. That which is in our power (eph' hêmin), according to Stoic ethics, is how we adapt ourselves to fate and live in harmony with it. Valens argues that we cannot change immutable fate, but we can control how we play the role we are given (5.9). He quotes Cleanthes, Euripides, and Homer on Fate (6.9; 7.3), emphasizing that one must not stray from the appointed course of Destiny. Valens maintains a sense of "astral piety," treating astrology as a religious practice, exemplified in the oath of secrecy upon the Sun, Moon, planets and signs of the zodiac in his introduction to Book 7. He asks his reader(s) to swear not to reveal the secrets of astrology to the uneducated or the uninitiated (tois apaideutois ê amuêtois), and to pay homage to one's initial instructor, otherwise bad things will befall them. In Book 5.9, he provides a Stoic argument in favor of prognostication through astrology. He considers the outcomes that Fate decrees to be immutable, and the goddesses of Hope (Elpis) and Fortune (Tukhê) acting as helpers of necessity and enslave men with the desires created by the turns and expectations of fortune. Those however who engage with prognostication have "calmness of soul" (atarakhôn), do not care for fortune or hope, are neither afraid of death nor prone to flattery, and are "soldiers of fate" (stratiôtai tês heimarmenês). While other places, Valens gives techniques for katarchical astrology (5.3; 9.6) he states that no amount of ritual or sacrifice can alter that which is fated in one's birth chart. He also considers the time of birth to account for dissimilar natures in two children born of the same parents. In keeping with his religious approach to astrology, he treats it as "a sacred and venerable learning as something handed over to men by god so they may share in immortality." Like Ptolemy, Valens also blames the imperfections of predictions on the astrologers – particularly the inattentiveness and superficiality of some of the learners.

Ptolemy and Valens stand as representatives of astrology in the second century, but their works were not the most prominent. Astrological concepts were also used in magic, Hermeticism, Gnosticism, Gnostic Christian sects such as the Ophites, and by the author of the Chaldaean Oracles. Other known astrologers of the second century include Antiochus of Athens and Manetho (not to be confused with the Egyptian historian). One additional astrologer will be treated for his philosophical position, Firmicus Maternus. Though because he was influenced by Neoplatonic theories, he will be included below in the section on Neoplatonism.

5. The Skeptics

Already mentioned is Pliny's acceptance of some methods of astrology and rejection of others based on numerology. Similarly mentioned was Ptolemy's rejection of various methods based on subdivisions of the zodiac and manipulations based on planetary numbers. Both he and Valens, as astrologers, criticized other practitioners for either shoddy methods or deliberate deception, posing their forms of divination as astrology. Valens went so far as to admonish those who dress up their "Barbaric" teachings in calculations as though they were Greek, perhaps in reference to the frequently maligned "Chaldaeans" (Anthologiarum, 2.35). Geminus of Rhodes, an astronomer of the mid-first century B.C.E., accepts some tenets of astrology, particularly the influence of aspects "geometrical relations" of planets, while rejecting others, such as the causal influence of emanations from fixed stars. Midde Stoic Panaetius is also known to have rejected astrology, most likely under the influence of his astronomer friend Scylax, who like other astronomers of the time, attempted to set the practice of astrology apart from astronomy. Arguments against astrology can be grouped into one of two categories (though there are other ways to classify them): ones that deny the efficacy of astrology or astrologers; and ones that admit that astrology "works" but question the morality of the practice. Arguments of the latter type include those that see astrology as a type of practice of living that assumes a strict fatalism. Some of the earliest arguments against astrology were launched by the skeptical New Academy in the second century B.C.E. Arguments against astrology on moral or ethical grounds would proliferate in Christian theologians such as Origen of Alexandria and other Church Fathers. Astrology would become an important issue for Neoplatonists, with some rejecting it and others embracing it, though not within a context of strict fatalism.

a. The New Academy (Carneades)

The earliest arguments against the efficacy of astrology have been traced to the fourth head of the skeptical New Academy, Carneades (c. 213-129 B.C.E.) (cf. Cramer, p. 52-56). As an advocate of free will, primarily against Stoic determinism, Carneades is likely to have influenced other philosophers who have argued against astrology. The arguments by Carneades, who left no writings, have been reconstructed as the following:

  1. Precise astronomical observations at the moment of birth are impossible (and astrological techniques depend on such precision).
  2. Those born at the same time have different destinies (as empirically observed)
  3. Those born neither at the same time or place often share the same death time (as in the case of natural disasters)
  4. Animals born at the same time as humans (according to strict astrological fatalism) would share the same fate.
  5. The presence of diverse ethnicities, customs and cultural beliefs is incompatible with astrological fatalism.

Astrologers would respond to the last argument with the incorporation of astro-geography or astro-chorography (perhaps as early as Posidonius), indicating an astral typology of a people, and used for the purpose of "mundane" astrology, predictions for entire nations, which would also account for the second argument. Astro-chorography can be found as early as Teukros of Babylon and Manilius, but might be traced to Posidonius' predecessor Cratos of Mallos.

b. Sextus Empiricus

About three centuries later, Pyrrhonian skeptic Sextus Empiricus would elaborate upon these arguments in "Against the Astrologers" (Pros astrologous, Book 5 of Pros mathêmatikous). He first outlines the procedure of drawing a birth chart, and the basic elements of astrology, the places (topoi), the benefic and malefic nature of the planets, and the criteria for determining the power of the planets. He also notes the disagreements among astrologers, particularly regarding subdivisions of the signs, a disagreement also noted by Ptolemy. Sextus first notes typical arguments against astrology: 1) earthly things do not reallysympathize with celestial. He uses an example from anatomy, namely, the head and lower parts of body sympathize because they have unity, and this unity is lacking in celestial/earthly correspondence; 2) It is held that some events happen by necessity, some by chance, some according to our actions. If predictions are made of necessary events, then they are useless; if of chance events, then they are impossible; if of that according to our will (para hêmas), then not predetermined at all. If as he says, these are arguments by the majority, then there was an attack on the theory of cosmic sympathy and on the use of prediction (any form of divination) on events determined by any or all of the three causes. This precludes the possibility that the planets and stars are causes that determine necessity in the sublunary realm, and it presents astrology as a form of strict determinism. Sextus continues by offering a more specific set of criticisms, including the five thought to originate with Carneades. He especially focuses on the inaccuracy of instruments and measurements used for determining either the time of birth or conception. To these criticisms he adds that astrologers associate shapes and characters of men (tas morphas kai ta êthê) with the characteristics of the zodiac signs, and questions, for example, why a Lion could be associated with bravery while an equally masculine animal, the Bull, is feminine in astrology. He also ridicules physiognomic descriptions, such that those who have Virgo ascending are straight-haired, bright-eyed, white-skinned; he wonders if there are no Ethiopian Virgos. Sextus adds the argument that predictions from the alignment of planets cannot be based on empirical observation since the same configurations do not repeat for 9977 years (one calculation of the Great Year. Many such calculations exist in the Hellenistic and Late Hellenistic eras, for the exact length of the cycle was debated).

6. Hermetic and Gnostic Astrological Theories

The "philosophical" Hermetica, texts in the Hermetic tradition that are typically of later origin than the "technical" astronomical and magical fragments, share astrological imagery in common with another heterogeneous group of texts known as "Gnostic." (See more on Hermeticism and Gnosticism in Middle Platonism and Gnosticism). A factor present in both collections is the role planets and stars play in the cosmologies and eschatologies, one in which the planets and other celestial entities are seen as oppressive forces or binding powers from which the soul, by nature divine and exalted above the cosmo, must break free. Fate (Heimarmenê) plays a major role in the Hermetic texts, and astrology is sometimes taken for granted as knowledge of the Fate by which the mortal part of a human being is subjected to at birth (cf.Stobaei Hermetica, Excerpt VII). The planets are said to be subservient to Fate and Necessity, which are subordinate powers to God's providence (pronoia). In the Poimandres text, God made man in his own image, but also made a creator god (demiurge) who made seven administrators (the planets) whose government is Fate. Man being two-fold, is both immortal, and above the celestial government, and mortal, so also a slave within the system, for he shares a bit of the nature of each of the planets. At death the soul of the individual who recognizes their immortal, intellectual, and divine self ascends, while gradually surrendering the various qualities accumulated during the descent: the body is given to dissolution; the character (êthos) is yielded to the daimon (cf. Heraclitus, Fr. 119); and through each the seven planetary zones, a portion of the incarnated self that is related to the negative astrological meaning of each planet (e.g., arrogance to the Sun, greed to Jupiter) is given back to that zone. Arriving at the eighth zone, the soul is clothed in its own power (perhaps meaning its own astral body), while it is deified (in God) in the zone above the eighth (some Gnostic texts also refer to a tenth realm). Astrological fatalism, then, is modified by the Platonic immortal soul whose proper place is above the cosmic order. Astrology affects the temperament and life while in the mortal body, but not ultimately the soul. Another Hermetic text that incorporates astrology is the Secret Sermon on the Mount of Hermes to Tat (Corpus Hermeticum, Book XIII). Here the life-bearing zodiac is responsible for creating twelve torments or passions that mislead human beings. These twelve are overcome by ten powers of God, such as self-control, joy and light. In Excerpt XXIII of the Stobaei Hermetica, the zodiac is again thought responsible for giving life (to animals) while each planet contributes part of their nature to human being. In this instance, as well as in Excerpt XXIX, what the planets contribute is not all vice, but both good and bad in a way that corresponds with the nature of each planet in astrological theory. The Discourses from Hermes to Tat is a discussion of the thirty-six decans, a remnant of Egyptian religion, which was incorporated into Hellenistic astrology. The decans are guardian gods who dwell above the zodiac, and added by servants and soldiers that dwell in the aether, they affect collective events such as earthquakes, famines and political upheaval. Furthermore, the decans are said to rule over the planets and to sow good and bad daimons on earth. Although Fate is an integral part of these Hermetic writings, it seems that the transmission of the Hermetic knowledge, which intends to aid the soul to overcome Fate, is for the elect, because most men, inclining towards evil, would deny their own responsibility for evil and injustice (Excerpt VI). This is a rehashing of the Lazy Man Argument used against Stoic determinism, though cast in the light of astral fatalism.

Hippolytus, being mostly informed by Irenaeus, tells us that the Christian Marcion and his followers used Pythagorean numerology and astrology symbolism in their sect, and that they further divided the world into twelve regions using astro-geography (6.47-48). They may have used a table of astro-numerology like that found in Teukros of Babylon. Some Gnostic sects such as the Phibionites, as did the Christian Marcionites associated each degree of the zodiac with a particular god or daimon. Single degrees of the zodiac (monomoiria) were governed by each planets. The astrologers assigned each degree to a planet by various methods as outlined in the compilation of Paul of Alexandria. For the Gnostics, the degrees were hypostatized as beings that did the dirty work of the planets, who themselves are governed by higher beings on the ontological scale as produced by the Ogdoad, and Decade, and Dodecade, and ultimately leading to a cosmic ruler or demiurge, typically called Ialdabaoth, though varying based on the specific version of the cosmo-mythology of each sect. It is likely that the astrologers and the Gnostics did not use these divisions in the zodiac in the same way. Assignment of planets to divisions of the zodiac is typically used in astrology for determining the relative strength of the planets, and in the case of Critodemus (cited in Valens, 8.26), in a technique for determining length of life. The monomoiria may have been used in the Gnostic and/or Hermetic writers for the sake of gaining knowledge of the powers that oppress in order to overcome them.

In the Chaldaean Oracles, a text of the second century and thought to bear the influence of Numenius, one finds a view of the cosmos similar to that found in the Hermetic corpus. However, the divine influences from above are mediated by Hecate, who separates the divine from the earthly realm and governs Fate. Fate is a force of Nature and the irrational soul of a human being is bound to it, but the theurgic practices of bodily and mental purification, utilizing the rational soul, is preparation for the ascent through the spheres, the dwelling place of the intelligible soul and the Father God. The Oracles share with the Gnostic and Hermetic texts a hierarchy of powers including the zodiac, planets and daimons.

7. Neoplatonism and Astrology

Neoplatonism is typically thought to have originated with Plotinus; though his philosophy, like every Late Hellenistic philosophy and religion, did not develop in a vacuum. Plotinus was acquainted with the Middle Platonists Numenius and Albinus, as well as Aristotelian, Neopythagorean, Gnostic, and Stoic philosophies. Numenius (fl. 160-180 C.E.) shares with the Hermetic and Gnostic cosmologies the notion that the soul of human beings descends through the cosmos (through the Gateway of Cancer), loses memory of its divine life, and acquires its disposition from the planets. The qualities of the planets are again astrological, but vary by degree based on the distance from the intelligible realm – at the highest planetary sphere, Saturn confers reason and understanding, while at the lowest, the Moon contributes growth of the physical body. During the ascent, judges are placed at each planetary sphere; if the soul is found wanting, it returns to Hades above the waters between the Moon and Earth, then is reincarnated for ages until it is set right in virtue (based on the Myth of Er in Plato's Republic 10.614-621).

The cosmological schemes, particularly the ontological hierarchies, in Middle Platonic, Gnostic and Neopythagorean thinkers typically allows for the place of astrology, if not in a strictly deterministic way for the entire human being, for the transcendent soul descends and ascends through the cosmos and one's own actions determine future ontological status. This context places Neoplatonic philosophy in a difficult relationship with astrology and fatalism. Plotinus is unique in that he reverses the ontological status of the soul and the cosmos, for the All-Soul (World-Soul, Nous) is the creator and governor of the cosmos, but not a part of it. His philosophy, which exalts the soul above the cosmos and above the ordinance of time, forms the basis for some of his arguments against astrology.

a. Plotinus

Plotinus (204-270 C.E.) takes up the issue of astrology in Ennead 3.1 "On Fate," and in more detail in the later Ennead 2.3, "Are the Stars Causes?" (chronologically, the 52nd treatise, or third from the last). In the first text, Plotinus points out that some hold the belief that the heavenly circuit rules over everything, and the configurations of the planets and stars determine all events within this whole fated structure (3.1.2). He then elaborates upon an astrology based on Stoic cosmic sympathy theory (sumpnoia), in which animals and plants are also under sympathetic influence of the heavenly bodies, and regions of the earth are likewise influenced (3.1.5). Many astrologers divided countries into astrological zones corresponding to zodiac signs (cf. Manilius Astronomica, 4.744-817). Plotinus briefly presents the arguments that for one, this strict determinism leaves nothing up to us, and leaves us to be "rolling stones" (lithous pheromenois - this recalls the rolling cylinder example in Stoicism). Secondly, he says the influence of the parents is stronger on disposition and appearance than the stars. Thirdly, recounting the New Academy argument, he says that people born at the same time ought to share the same fate (but do not). Given this, he does argue that planets can be used for predictive purposes, because they can be used for divination like bird omens (3.1.6; 3.3.6; 2.3.7-8). The diviner, however, has no place in calling them causes since it would take a superhuman effort to unravel the series of concomitant causes in the organism of the living cosmos, in which each part participates in the whole.

In Ennead 2.3, his arguments can be divided into two types, the first being a direct assault against the specific doctrines and language used by astrologers, the second concerning the roles that the stars have on the individual soul's descent into matter, as he sees in accordance with Plato's Timaeus and Republic10. In the first set of arguments, Plotinus displays more intimate familiarity with the language of technical astrology. He turns around the perspective of this language from the observer to the view from the planets themselves. He finds it absurd, for instance, that planets affect one another when they "see" one another and that a pair of planets could have opposite affections for one another when in the region of the other (2.3.4). Another example of the switched perspective is his criticism of planetary "hairesis" doctrine, such that each planet is naturally diurnal or nocturnal and rejoices in its chosen domain. He counters that it is always day for the planets. More pertinent to his philosophy, Plotinus then poses questions about the ontological status of the planets and stars. If planets are not ensouled, they could only affect the bodily nature. If they are ensouled, their effects would be minor, not simply due to the great distance from earth, but because their effects would reach the earth as a mixture, for there are many stars and one earth (2.3.12). Plotinus does think planets are ensouled because they are gods (3.1.5). Furthermore, there are no bad planets (as astrologers claim of Mars and Saturn) because they are divine (2.3.1). They do not have in their nature a cause of evil, and do not punish human beings because we have no effect on their own happiness (2.3.2). Countering moral characteristics that astrologers attribute to the zodiac and planets, Plotinus argues that virtue is a gift from God, and vice is due to external circumstances that happen as the soul is immersed in matter (2.3.9; 2.3.14).

Plotinus does concede that just as human beings are double in nature, possessing the higher soul and the lower bodily nature, so are planets. The planets in their courses are in a better place than beings on earth, but they are not themselves completely unchanging, like beings in the realm of Intellect (2.1). In this regard he attempts to square the contribution of the stars to one's disposition in the Spindle of Fate in Plato'sRepublic 10, to his belief in free will. From the stars we get our character (êthê), characteristic actions (êthê praxeis) and emotions (pathê). He asks what is left that is "we" (hêmeis), and answers that nature gave us the power to govern (kratein) passions (pathôn) (2.3.9). If this double-natured man does not live in accordance with virtue, the life of the intellect that is above the cosmos, then "the stars do not only show him signs but he also becomes himself a part, and follows along with the whole of which he is a part" (2.3.9, tr. Armstrong).

In summary, Plotinus ridicules astrological technical doctrine for what he sees as a belief in the direct causality of the planets and stars on the fate of the individual. He also finds offensive the attribution of evil or evil-doing to the divine planets. However, he does believe that planets and stars are suited for divination because they are part of the whole body of the cosmos, and all parts are co-breathing (sumpnoia) and contribute to the harmony of the whole (2.3.7). The planets do not, then, act upon their own whims and desires.

b. Porphyry

Plotinus' best-known student, Porphyry of Tyre (c. 232/3-304/5), held quite a different view on astrology. He wrote a lost work on astrology, Introduction to Astronomy in Three Books (the word "astronomy" meaning "astrology"), and put together an Introduction to Ptolemy's Tetrabiblos (Eisagôgê eis tên Apotelesmatikên tou Ptolemaiou). In this work he heavily draws upon (and in some cases copies directly from) Antiochus of Athens, an astrologer of the late second century C.E. Antiochus' influence was considerable, and perhaps greater than Ptolemy's in the third and fourth centuries, since he was referenced by several later astrologers such as Firmicus Maternus, Hephaistion of Thebes, Rhetorius, and the medieval "Palchus." It may be that Porphyry encountered Antiochus' work when he studied in Athens under Longinus (another student of Ammonius Saccas) before continuing his Platonic education under Plotinus. Porphyry attempts to reconcile his belief in astrology with the Platonic belief in a free an exalted soul that is separable from the body. As a Pythagorean, Porphyry promoted abstinence from meat and other methods of detachment from the body as promoting virtue and a life of Nous. (cf. Launching Points to the Realm of the Mind; Letter to Marcella;On Abstinence). In an earlier work of which only fragments exist, Concerning Philosophy from Oracles, Porphyry asserts that gods and the demons use observations of the movements of stars to predict events decreed by Fate, a doctrine originating with the Stoics. He claims astrologers are sometimes incorrect in their predictions because they make faulty interpretations (while assuming that the principles of astrology itself are not false) (cf. Amand, p. 165-166; Eusebius Praeparatio evangelica, 6.1.2-5). In another fragment (Stobaeus, 2.8.39-42), Porphyry interprets Plato's Myth of Er (Republic 10.614-621) as justification for the compatibility of astrology and free choice (Amand, p. 164-165). Before the souls descend to earth, they are free to choose their guardian daimon. When on earth, they are subject to Fate and necessity based on the lot chosen. Porphyry says this is in agreement with the (Egyptian) astrologers who think that the ascending zodiac sign (hôroskopos), and the arrangement of the planets in the zodiac signify the life that was chosen by the soul (Stobaeus, 2.8.39-42). He notes, as does Plotinus (Enn., 2.3.7), that the stars are scribbling on the heavens that give signs of the future. Both Porphyry and Plotinus discuss the Myth of Er and the stars as giving divinatory signs (sêmainô), but Porphyry accepts the astrological tradition filled with complicated calculations and strange language, while Plotinus rejects it.

Porphyry's Introduction to Ptolemy's Tetrabiblos contains little content from Ptolemy, and purports to fill in the terminology and concepts that Ptolemy had taken for granted. Porphyry says that by explicating the language in as simple a way as possible, these concepts will become clear to the uninitiated. His great respect for Ptolemy is evident by his other work on the study of Ptolemy's Harmonics, and by statements that he makes of his debt, but he includes in the compilation numerous techniques that Ptolemy rejected. The debt he may be paying though, may actually be to readers of Plotinus. It may be a response to Plotinus' criticism of the language of astrology and the belief that stars are causes. Porphyry seems to think that understanding the complicated scientific language will give back the credence to astrology that the naturalistic model by Ptolemy took away (at least for his most respected teacher).

In the Letter to Anebo, Porphyry poses a series of questions about the order of and distinctions between visible and invisible Gods and daimons, and about the mantic arts. He mentions the ability of some to judge, but the configurations of the stars, whether or not divinatory predictions will be true and false, and if theurgic activity will be fruitful or in vain (Epistula ad Anebonem, 2.6c - in reference to katarchical astrology). He also asks about the symbolism of the images of the Sun that change by the hour (these figures are twelve Egyptian forms that co-rise with the ascending signs of the zodiac. The dôdekaôrai. These uneven hours were measured by the time it took for each sign to rise; cf. Greek Magical Papryi, PGM IV 1596-1715). In this work, though, he complains of Egyptian priest/astrologers such as Chaeremon, who reduce their gods to forces of nature, do not allow for incorporeals, and hold to a strict deterministic astral fatalism (Epist. Aneb., 2.13a). Porphyry concludes with questions about the practice of astrologers of finding one's own daimon, and what sort of power it imparts to us (Epist. Aneb., 2.14a-2.16a; cf. Vettius Valens, Book 3.1; Hephaistion, Apotelesmatica, 13; 20). Again, reconciling his notions of virtue and free will with astrology, he states that if it is possible to know one's daimon (indicated by the planet derived through a set of rules and designated as the oikodespotês) from the birth chart, then one can be free from Fate. He notes the difficulties and disagreements among astrologers about how to find this all-important indicator. In fact, in Introduction to Ptolemy's Tetrabiblos (30), he includes a lengthy chapter (again, borrowing from Antiochus of Athens) that explains a method for finding the oikodespotês) and for differentiating this from other ruling planets (such as the kurios and theepikratêtôr). As will be explicated, Iamblichus, who formed his own unique relationship to astrology, answered these questions in his De mysteriis.

c. Iamblichus

While Iamblichus (c. 240-325 C.E.) believed in the soul's exaltation above the cosmos, he did not, like Plotinus, think that the embodied soul of the human being is capable of rising above the cosmos and its ordering principle of Fate through simple contemplation upon the One, or the source of all things. Iamblichus responds to Porphyry's accusation that Egyptian religion is only materialistic: just as the human being is double-natured, an incorporeal soul immersed in matter, this duality is replicated at each level of being (5.20). Theurgy, for most people, should begin with the material gods that have dominion over generation and corruption of bodies. He does not think the masses are capable of intellectual means of theurgy (this is reserved for the few and for a later stage in life), but that a theurgist must start at their own level of development and individual inclinations. His complex hierarchy of beings, including celestial gods, visible gods, angels and daimons, justifies a practice of theurgy in which each of these beings is sacrificed and prayed to appropriately, in a manner pleasing to and in sympathy with their individual natures. Material means, i.e., use of stones, herbs, scents, animals, and places, are used in theurgy in a manner similar to magical practices common in the Late Hellenistic era, with the notable difference that they are used simply to please and harmonize with the order of the higher beings, rather than to obtain either an earthy or intellectual desire. Divinity pervades all things, and earthly things receive a portion of divinity from particular gods.

Answering Porphyry's question about the meaning of the Sun god seated on the Lotus (an Egyptian astrological motif), Iamblichus responds that the images that change with the zodiacal hours are symbolic of an incorporeal (and unchanging) God who is unfolded in the Light through images representing his multiple gifts. His position above the Lotus (which, being circular, represents the motion of the Intellect) indicates his transcendence over all things. Curiously, Iamblichus also says that the zodiac signs along with all celestial motions, receive their power from the Sun, placing them ontologically subordinate to it (De mysteriis, 7.3).

Next addressing Porphyry's question about astral determinism of Chaeremon (who is thought to be a first century Alexandrian astrologer/priest versed in Stoic philosophy; cf. Porphyry, De abstinentia, 4.6; Origen Contra Celsum, 1.59; Cramer, p. 116-118) and others, Iamblichus indicates that the Hermetic writings pertaining to natal astrology play a minor role in the scope of Hermetic/Egyptian philosophy (De myst., 8.4) Iamblichus does not deny the value of natal astrology, but considers it to be concerned with the lower material life, hence subordinate to the intellectual. Likewise, not all things are bound to Necessity because theurgic exercises can elevate the soul above the cosmos and above Fate (8.7). On Porphyry's question about finding one's personal daimon through astrological calculation, Iamblichus responds that the astrological calculations can say nothing about the guardian daimon. Since the natal chart is a matter concerning one's fatedness, and the daimon is assigned prior to the soul's descent (it is more ancient; presbutera) and subjection to fate, such human and fallible sciences as astrology are useless in this important matter (9.3-4). In general, Iamblichus does not show much inclination for use of astrological techniques found in Ptolemy, Antiochus, and other astrologers, but he does believe that astrology is in fact a true science, though polluted by human errors (9.4). He also accepts and uses material correspondences to celestial gods (including planets), as well as katarchical astrology, observations used for selecting the proper times (8.4).

d. Firmicus Maternus

Julius Firmicus Maternus was a fourth century Sicilian astrologer who authored an astrological work in eight books, Matheseos, and about ten years later, a Christian polemical work, On the Error of Profane Religions (De errore profanarium religionum). Unlike Augustine (who studied astrology in his youth), Firmicus did not launch polemics against astrology after his conversion to Christianity He is mentioned briefly for his Neoplatonic justification for the practice of astrology. While he claims only meager knowledge in astrology, his arguments betray a passionate commitment to a belief in astral fatalism. He treats astrological knowledge as a mystery religion, and as Vettius Valens did before him, he asks his reader, Mavortius, to take an oath of secrecy and responsibility concerning astrological knowledge. He refers to Porphyry (along with Plato and Pythagoras) as a likeminded keeper of mysteries (7.1.1). In De errore, however, he attacks Porphyry for the same reason, that he was a follower of the Serapis cult of Alexandria (Forbes' translation, p. 72). Firmicus' oath is upon the creator god (demiurge) who is responsible for the order of the cosmos and for arranging the planets as stations along the way of the souls' ascent and descent (7.1.2).

While outlining the arguments of astrology's opponents, (including the first and second arguments of the New Academy, mentioned above), Firmicus claims not to have made up his mind concerning the immortality of the soul (Matheseos, 1.1.5-6), but he shortly betrays a Platonic belief in an immortal soul separable from the body (1.3.4). These souls follow the typical Middle Platonic ascent and descent through the planetary spheres; as a variation on this theme, he holds the notion that souls descend through the sphere of the Sun and ascend through the sphere of the Moon (1.5.9). This sovereign soul is capable of true knowledge, and, by retaining an awareness in spite of its forgetful and polluted state on Earth, can know Fate imperfectly through the methods of astrology handed down from Divine Mind (mentis treated as a Latin equivalent for nous, 1.4.1-5; 1.5.11). In response to the critics, he suggests that they do not have first hand knowledge and that if they encountered false predictions, the fault lies with the fraudulent pretenders to astrology and not with the science itself (1.3.6-8). For Firmicus, the planets, as administrators of a creator God, give each individual soul their character and personality (1.5.6-7).

After offering profuse praise of Plotinus, Firmicus attacks his belief that everything is in our powers and that superior providence and reason can overcome fortune. He argues that Plotinus made this claim in the prime of his health, but that he too accepted the powers of Fate toward the end of his life, since all efforts to advert poor health, such as moving to a better climate, failed him (1.7.14-18). Following this and other examples offered to his reader of fated events, he argues against the notion held by some, that fate (heimarmenê) only controls birth and death. This argument may be a precursor of the definition of fate that Hierocles offered a century later, which will be discussed next.

e. Hierocles

Hierocles of Alexandria is a fifth century Neoplatonist who argued against astrology, particularly an astrological theory based on a Stoic view of Fate and Necessity. He also rejected magical and theurgical practices prevalent in his time as a way to either escape or overcome the fate set down in one's birth chart. His argument against these practices is based on his view of Providence and Fate, found in his work On Providence, which only survives in later summaries by ninth century Byzantine Patriarch, Photius. In general, Hierocles saw himself in line with the thinkers starting with Ammonius Saccas, who argue for the compatibility between Plato and Aristotle, while he rejects thinkers who emphasize their differences, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias. His view of Fate is that it is an immutable ordering of thinking according to divine Justice. Using, as do Plotinus and Porphyry, Plato's Myth of Er (Rep., 10), fate is a system of rewards and punishments the souls choose before reincarnation on earth. He does not, though, like Porphyry, accept the transmigration of the soul from human to animal body and vice versa. This view on reincarnation had already been put forth by Cronius, a contemporary of Numenius (cf. Dillon, p. 380). He considers astrology to be contrary to this notion of Fate because it works by a principle of "mindless necessity" (enepilogiston anagkên). Photius writes of Hierocles:

He does not at all accept the irrational "necessity" spoken of by the astrologers, nor the Stoic "force," nor even what Alexander of Aphrodisias supposed it to be, who identifies it with the nature of Platonic Bodies. Nor does he accept that one' birth can be altered by incantations and sacrifices. (Codex 214, 172b, tr. Schibli, p. 333)

The astrological theory he is arguing against is supported by Stoic fate and necessity, which assumes a chain of physical efficient causes. The astrologers who most closely represent this view are Manilius and Vettius Valens (link to above sections). There is nothing in the surviving summary to indicate that Hierocles also argues against the notion of Plotinus and Porphyry that the stars are signs rather than causes, because they are part of the rational and divine order of all things. Since he believed there is nothing outside of rational Providence, including that which is in our power (to eph' hêmin), the stars too would be a part of the rational ordering. His fate, being quite deterministic but based on moral justice, does not allow for magic and theurgic practices used to exonerate one from his Fate revealed through astrology (cf. Porphyry's Letter to Anebo; Greek Magic Papyri, XIII, 632-640). These practices he saw as unlawful attempts to manipulate or escape the ordering of things by the Providence of God.

f. Proclus

Proclus (410/11-485) was the director of the Platonic School at Athens, which called itself the "Academy" in order to maintain lineage with Plato's fourth century school. In the absence of direct statements about the astrology, Proclus' position on astral fatalism can be surmised through his philosophy, particularly his metaphysical hierarchy of beings. A paraphrase of Ptolemy's astrological work, Tetrabiblos, is attributed to him, though there is little evidence to make a substantial claim about the identity of the author/copyist. Proclus did, however, take a keen interest in astronomy, and critiqued Ptolemy's astronomical work,Syntaxis (or Almagest) in his Outline of Astronomical Hypotheses. In this work, he argues against Ptolemy's theory of precession of the equinox (Hyp. astr., 234.7-22), although other Plato/Aristotle synthesizers, such as Simplicius, accepted it along with the additional spheres the theory would entail beyond the eighth (the fixed stars).

Proclus generally proposed three levels of being - celestial, earthly, and in-between. The four elements exist at every level of being, though fire (in the form of light) predominates in the celestial realm. Celestial beings are independent, self-subsistent, divine, and have their own will and power. As ensouled beings, celestial bodies are self-moving (the Platonic notion of soul). In order to maintain a consistency with Platonic doctrine, he argued against the notion that celestial spheres are solid paths upon which the planets and stars are carried along. Rather they are places possessing latitude, longitude, and depth (bathos – a measure of proximity to earth), which are projected by the free planets as their potential course. As visible gods, he thought the planets to be intermediaries between the intelligible realm and the sensible. In terms of planets being causes, he accepts the Aristotelian notion that they cause physical changes below (due to heat and light). However, he also accepted another type of non-physical causality, more akin to cosmic sympathy, in which several causes come together to form a single effect at a proper time and place. Everything lower in the hierarchy is dependent upon the higher, and is given its proper lot (klêros) and signature (sunthêma) of the higher beings. The celestial gods also have a ruling power over lower beings (Institutio theological, 120-122). This notion of properness (epitêdeiotês) extends from the celestial realm to all things below, including plants and metals (cf. Siovanes, p. 128-129). This is much akin to astrological theory, in which each planet and sign contributes, in varying proportions, to a single effect, the individual. The planetary gods are not the only actors, for they have invisible guardians (doruphoroi - not to be confused with the planets who guard the Sun and the Moon in astrological doctrine) who populate that the space of the planets' courses, and who act as administrators. Proclus, though, is not a strict astral determinism, for as a theurgist, he also thought these allotments can be changed through theurgic knowledge (In Platonis Timaeum commentaria, 1.145).

8. Astrology and Christianity

Astrology's relationship with early Christianity has a very complex history. Prior to being established as the official religion of the Roman Empire, the attitude of Jews and Christians toward astrology varied greatly. Philo of Alexandria and various Jewish pseudepigraphical writers condemned the practice of astrology (1 Enoch, Sibylline Oracles), while other texts accept portions of it and depict biblical figures such as Abraham and Noah as astrologers (cf. Barton, Ancient Astrology, p. 68-70). As mentioned above, early Christians such as Marcion and Basilides incorporated some aspects of astrology into their belief systems. In general, though, for the earliest Christian polemicists and theologians, astrology was incompatible with the faith for a number of reasons, mostly pertaining to the immorality of its fatalism. Some of the Christian arguments against astrology were borrowed from the skeptical schools. Hippolytus of Rome (170-236 C.E.) dedicating nearly an entire book (4) of his Refutations Against All Heresies, closely followed the detailed arguments from Sextus Empiricus, particularly concerning the lack of accurate methods for discerning the time of birth, which is required for establishing the natal chart. He is particularly troubled by the associations between signs of the zodiac and physiognomical features. Hippolytus outlines a list very similar to that of Teukros of Babylon (as contained in the latter's De duodecim signis) containing correspondences between physiological and psychological characteristics; and he argues that the constellations were merely markers for star recognition, bear no resemblance to the animals by which they are named, and can bear no resemblance to human characteristics (Refutatio omnium haeresium, 4.15-27).

Bardaisan/Bardesanes (c 154-222 C.E.) was a converted Syriac Christian, who, like Augustine, studied astrology in his youth. It appears that in his conversion he did not give up all astrological thinking, for he accepts the role of the planets and stars as administrators of God. He wrote against astro-chorography, particularly the association of regions with planets based on seven climata or zones, stating that laws and customs of countries are based on institution of human free will and not on the planets. Along with free will, though, he accepts a degree of governance of nature and of chance, indicated by the limit of things in our control. Bardesanes is thought to be a forerunner of Mani, for he accepted a dualism of two world forces, dark and light (cf. Rudolf, Gnosis, p. 327-329).

Origen of Alexandria's (185-254 C.E.) relationship to astrology was equally, if not more, complex than that of Plotinus. In his Commentary on Genesis he, in a manner similar to Plotinus, offers arguments against stars as causes, but in favor of stars as signs, divine writings in the sky. These writings are available for divine powers to gain knowledge and to participate in the providential aide of human beings (Philocalia, 23.1-23.21; cf. Barton, Power and Knowledge, p. 63-64). Origen believed that all beings, celestial, human or in-between, have the role of helping all creatures attain salvation. Celestial beings play a particular role in this cosmological paideia of educating creatures toward virtue. These signs, however, are imperfect at the human level, and cannot give exact knowledge (Philocalia, 23.6). Elsewhere (De oratione, 7.1), Origen urges us to pray for the Sun, Moon and stars (rather than to them), for they are also free beings (so he surmises by interpreting Psalm 148:3) and play a unique role in the salvation of the cosmos. Quite uniquely, Origen also appears to have been one of the first philosophers (if not the first) to use the theory of precession of the equinox as an argument against astrological prediction (Philocalia, 23.18).

Origen argued against those in antiquity who interpreted the Star of Bethlehem as an astrological prediction of the birth of Christ made by the Chaldaeans. He first notes that the Magi (from Persia) are to be distinguished from Chaldaeans (a word which at the time generally referred to Babylonian astrologers or simply astrologers). Secondly, he argues that the star was unlike any other astral phenomenon they had observed, and they perceived that it represented someone (Christ) superior to any person known before, not simply by the sign of the star, but by the fact that their usual sorcery and knowledge from evil daimons had failed them (Contra Celsum, 59-60). In general, regardless of the intentions of the gospel writers of including the myth of the Star of Bethlehem, it was interpreted by Christians not as a prediction by astrological methods of divination, but as a symbol of Christ transcending the old cosmic order, particularly fate oppressing the divinely granted human free will, and replacing it with a new order (cf. Denzey, "A New Star on the Horizon," in Prayer, Magic, and the Stars, p. 207-221).

Three fourth century theologians, Gregory of Nyssa, Gregory Nazianzen, and Basil, known as the Cappadocians, rejected astrology as a part of an overall rejection of irrational Chance (Tukhê) and deterministic Necessity (Anankê) (see Pelikan, p. 154-157). Random chance had no place in the economy of God's universe, while blind necessity denies human free will. They differentiated astrology from astronomy, which was an appropriate study for admiration of creation. Unlike Origen and Plotinus, Gregory Nazianzen rejected the notion of that stars give signs for reading the future. He feared that those who interpret the biblical notion that the stars were created for giving signs (Genesis 1:14) would use this as justification for horoscopic astrology (Pelikan, p. 156).

In the Latin west, Augustine (354-430 C.E.) took up polemics against astrology in conjunction with his arguments against divination (De civitate dei, 5.1-7). His distain for astrology is related to his early exposure to it as a Manichean prior to his conversion to Christianity. In De civitate dei (City of God), he borrowed freely from Cicero's arguments against Stoic fate and divination. He particularly elaborated upon the New Academy argument that people born at the same time having different destinies (the twin argument). He includes in his attack on astrology the futility of katarchic astrology (choosing the proper moments for activities) as well as its contradiction with deterministic natal astrology. If persons are predestined by their natal charts, how can they hope to change fate by choosing the proper time for marriage, planting crops, etc? In addition, he attributes correct predictions by astrologers to occasional inspiration of evil daimons rather than the study of astrological techniques (De civ., 5.7).

As Christianity gained political and cultural ascendancy, decrees against astrology multiplied. With the closing of the "pagan" schools in 529, Neoplatonists and the astrology attached to them fled to Persia. Substantial debate exists about whether or not they set up a new school in Persia, specifically Harran, and likely, later, in Baghdad; but one thing that is certain is that astrological texts and astronomical tables (such as the Pinax of Ptolemy) used for casting charts were translated into Persian and adjusted for the sixth century. The astrological writings, particularly of Ptolemy, Dorotheus, and Vettius Valens, were then translated into Arabic and would become a part of Islamic philosophy. The Greek texts, in combination with developments in Persia and the astrology of India, would form the basis of medieval astrology. Astrology from that point on would continued its unique history, both combining with and striving against philosophical and scientific theories, up to the present day.

9. References and Further Reading

  • Amand, David. Fatalisme et Liberté dans L'Antiquité Grecqué (Lovain: Bibliothèque de L'Université, 1945)
  • Barton, Tamsyn. Ancient Astrology (London: Routledge, 1994)
  • Barton, Tamsyn. Power and Knowledge: Astrology, Physiognomics, and Medicine under the Roman Empire (Ann Arbor: University of Michigan Press, 1994)
  • Bobzien, Susanne. Determinism and Freedom in Stoic Philosophy (Oxford University Press, 1998)
  • Catalogus Codicum Astrologorum Graecorum, ed. D. Olivieri, et al., 12 Volumes (Brussels: Academie Royale, 1898-1953)
  • Cramer, Frederick H. Astrology in Roman Law and Politics (Philadelphia: American Philosophical Society, 1959)
  • Denzey, Nicola. "A New Star on the Horizon: Astral Christologies and Stellar Debates in the Early Christian Discourse," in Prayer, Magic, and the Stars, ed. Scott B Noegel (University Park, PA: Pennsylvania University Press, 2003).
  • Dillon, John. The Middle Platonists (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1977)
  • Dillon, John and A. A. Long, eds. The Question of "Eclecticism": Studies in Later Greek Philosophy(Berkeley, CA: University of California Press, 1988)
  • Edelstein, L. and I. G. Kidd, eds. Posidonius: I. The Fragments (Cambridge University Press, 1972)
  • Firmicus Maternus, The Error of the Pagan Religions, tr. Clarence A. Forbes (NY: Newman Press, 1970)
  • Firmicus Maternus. Mathesis, Vol. I and II, ed. W. Kroll and F. Skutsch (Stuttgart: Teubner, 1968)
  • Firmicus Maternus, Matheseos Libri VIII, tr. Jean Rhus Bram (Park Ridge, NJ: Noyes Press, 1975)
  • Fowden, Garth. Egyptian Hermes (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1986)
  • Green, William Chase. Moira: Fate, Good, & Evil in Greek Thought (Harper & Row, 1944)
  • Gundel, W. and Gundel, H. G. Astrologumena: die astrologische Literatur in der Antike und ihre Geschichte (Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner Verlag GMBH, 1966)
  • Holden, James Herschel. A History of Horoscopic Astrology (Tempe, AZ: American Federation of Astrologers, Inc, 1996)
  • Hunger, Hermann, and David Pingree. Astral Science in Mesopotamia (Leiden: Brill, 1999).
  • Iamblichus. On the Mysteries, tr. Thomas Taylor (San Francisco: Wizards Bookshelf, 1997)
  • Layton, Bentley, tr. and ed. The Gnostic Scriptures (New York: Doubleday, 1987).
  • Long, A. A. ed. Problems in Stoicism (London: Athlone Press, 1971).
  • Long, A. A., and D. N. Sedley. The Hellenistic Philosophers, Vol. 1 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1987)
  • Manilius. Astronomica, tr. G. P. Goold (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1977)
  • Neugebauer, Otto. Astronomy and History: Selected Essays (New York: Springer-Verlag, 1983)
  • Pelikan, Jaroslav. Christianity and Classical Culture (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1993)
  • Plutarch. Plutarchi moralia (Leipzig: Teubner, 1929-1960)
  • Claudius Ptolemy. Tetrabiblos, tr. F. E. Robbins (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1956)
  • Reiner, Erica. Astral Magic in Babylonia (Philadelphia: The American Philosophical Society, 1995)
  • Rochberg, F. Babylonian Horoscopes, trans. Amer. Philos. Soc., Vol. 99, 1 (Philadelphia, 1998)
  • Rudolf, Kurt. Gnosis: The Nature and History of Gnosticism, tr. Robert McLachlan Wilson (San Francisco, CA: Harper San Francisco, 1987)
  • Sandbach, F. H. The Stoics (London: Chatto & Windus, 1975)
  • Schibli, Hermann S. Hierocles of Alexandria (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002).
  • Scott, Walter, ed. and tr. Hermetica Vol 1. (Boston: Shambala, 1985)
  • Sextus Empiricus. Against the Professors, Vol IV (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1949)
  • Shaw, Gregory. Theurgy and the Soul: The Neoplatonism of Iamblichus (University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1995)
  • Siovanes, Lucas. Proclus: Neo-Platonic Philosophy and Science (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1996).
  • Stoicorum veterum fragmenta, ed. J. von Arnim (Leipzig: Teubner, 1903)
  • Vettius Valens. Anthology, ed. David Pingree (Leipzig: Teubner, 1986)

Author Information

Marilynn Lawrence
West Chester University of Pennsylvania
U. S. A.

Feminist Epistemology

Feminist epistemology is an outgrowth of both feminist theorizing about gender and traditional epistemological concerns. Feminist epistemology is a loosely organized approach to epistemology, rather than a particular school or theory. Its diversity mirrors the diversity of epistemology generally, as well as the diversity of theoretical positions that constitute the fields of gender studies, women’s studies, and feminist theory. What is common to feminist epistemologies is an emphasis on the epistemic salience of gender and the use of gender as an analytic category in discussions, criticisms, and reconstructions of epistemic practices, norms, and ideals. While feminist epistemology is not easily and simply characterized, feminist approaches to epistemology tend to share an emphasis on the ways in which knowers are particular and concrete, rather than abstract and universalizable. Feminist epistemologies take seriously the ways in which knowers are enmeshed in social relations that are generally hierarchical while also being historically and culturally specific. In addition, feminist epistemologies assume that the ways in which knowers are constituted as particular subjects are significant to epistemological problems such as warrant, evidence, justification, and theory-construction, as well as to our understanding of terms like “objectivity,” “rationality,” and “knowledge.”

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Critiques of Rationality and Dualisms
  3. Feminist Science Studies
    1. Feminist Naturalized Epistemologies
    2. Cultural Studies of Science
    3. Standpoint Theory
  4. Developmental Psychology, Object Relations Theory and the Question of ‘Women’s Ways of Knowing’
  5. Hermeneutics, Phenomenology, and Postmodernist Approaches
  6. Feminist Epistemic Virtue Theory
  7. Pragmatism and Feminist Epistemologies
  8. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

The themes which characterize feminist engagements with epistemology are not necessarily unique to feminist epistemologies, since these themes also crop up in science studies more generally, as well as in social epistemology. Feminist epistemologies are distinctive, however, in the use of gender as a category of epistemic analysis and re-construction. Feminist approaches to epistemology generally have their sources in one or more of the following traditions: feminist science studies, naturalistic epistemologies, cultural studies of science, Marxist feminism and related work in and about the social sciences, object relations theory and developmental psychology, epistemic virtue theory, postmodernism, hermeneutics, phenomenology, and pragmatism. Many feminist epistemological projects incorporate more than one of these traditions. For the sake of this entry, however, particular theorists have been segregated into these fairly arbitrary categories. The caveat here is that each particular theorist might just as well have been included under a number of different categories.

2. Critiques of Rationality and Dualisms

Work by Susan Bordo (1990) and Genevieve Lloyd (1984) analyzes the ways in which metaphors of masculinity operate in constructions of ideals of rationality and objectivity. Drawing on feminist discussions of object relations theory (Bordo) and of the role of the symbolic imaginary and metaphor in modern epistemological projects, both Lloyd and Bordo argue that the operations of the symbolic imaginary are implicated in the metaphysics of subjectivity and objectivity and in the characterization of epistemic problems that follow from that metaphysics. The result of the work done by these feminist historians is that ideals of reason, objectivity, autonomy, and disinterestedness operating in assumptions about inquiry, as well as the idea that the “perennial” problems of epistemology are gender neutral are now revealed to be connected to and constitutive of gender relations.

Bordo’s and Lloyd’s analyses provide resources for feminists working in science studies, as well as those working in Anglo-American analytic traditions. Much of the work in feminist epistemology is influenced by these critiques, and the emphasis that Lloyd especially places on the cognitive role of metaphor, is a starting point for much feminist work on the role of “affective” and “literary” aspects of cognition and philosophy more generally.

Susan Hekman’s (1990) work argues that dualisms of nature/culture, rational/irrational, subject/object, and masculine/feminine underwrite modernist epistemological projects and that feminist epistemology should aim to destabilize and deconstruct those dualisms. Hekman argues that such destablization can only take place if feminists refuse the dichotomous presuppositions of the modernist project, including the dichotomy of masculine/feminine and its role in identity ascriptions. The aim, then, of feminist epistemology is both the eradication of epistemology as a going concern with issues of truth, rationality, and knowledge and the undermining of gender categories.

Critics of feminist epistemology have charged that feminist critiques of rationality amount to a valorization of irrationality, a charge that misses the point of these critiques. If our ideals of rationality are to be interrogated and reconstructed, then, presumably, our ideals of irrationality will be so reconstructed as well, since the operative premise of Bordo’s, Lloyd’s and Hekman’s analyses are that the dichotomy of rationality and irrationality help to constitute the dualism of masculine/feminine and vice-versa. Thus, what critics take to be a valorization of irrationality can only appear so if those dichotomies remain in place.

3. Feminist Science Studies

Much of the initial work in feminist epistemology grew out of feminist critiques of, and engagement with, science. This work generally emphasizes the ways in which science has been marked by gender bias, not only in the fact that women are seriously underrepresented in the sciences, but also in the ways in which assumptions about gendered behavior serve an evidential role in dominant and widely accepted theories in such fields as anthropology, biology, and psychology (Bleier, (1984), Haraway (1988, 1989), Keller (1983, 1984)).

Harding and Hintikka’s (1983) collection represents early work primarily in science studies and epistemology but also includes early work that represents one of the primary and unique contributions of feminist epistemology: the incorporation of moral and political theory in discussions of epistemology and science.

The recognition that the process of scientific theory construction and inquiry essentially involved appeals to extra-scientific values was further developed by subsequent theorists augmenting the early critiques of gender bias in science. Rather than claiming that values and politics always compromised scientific inquiry, feminist theorists such as Nelson (1990), Longino (1990) and Harding (1986, 1991, 1998) argue that such values are always operating in evaluations of evidence, justification, and theory-construction and that trying to develop an epistemology for science that would make it less prone to gender bias requires the recognition of the ways in which values enter the process of scientific reasoning. Feminist theorists, thus, turned their attention to developing epistemologies that would allow for critical evaluation of the values that are shared, and, thus, often invisible, to inquirers in the sciences. Nelson’s work, drawing on Quine, develops a holistic approach to questions about evidence and justification, emphasizing the ways in which knowledge is held by communities, rather than by individual knowers who are abstractable members of such communities. Helen Longino argues for the value of pluralism in the construction of scientific models as a way of making the values and assumptions of scientific communities accessible for critical evaluation. Harding uses Marxist analysis to develop a feminist version of standpoint theory.

What these approaches to feminist science studies emphasize is that good science is not value-free science, since values are ineradicable from the process of scientific inquiry and theory-construction. Instead, they argue that good science is science that can critically evaluate the values and assumptions that operate epistemically in scientific theory construction and in the ways in which scientific problems are formulated. Good science is a science that can develop mechanisms for critically evaluating, not only the results of inquiry, but also the ways in which those results depend upon a raft of value-laden and theory-laden assumptions and facts.

Part of the problem with these approaches (with the exception of standpoint epistemologies, which are discussed in more detail below), however, is that they have few theoretical resources for dealing with questions about how such diversity can be brought into scientific theorizing, and how one could, in principle, exclude groups with commitments or values that are, on the face of it, anti-scientific (e.g. magic) or unpalatable in other ways (e.g. Nazi science). If the value of pluralism is that it would allow for the critical reflection necessary for ensuring that the values and commitments that enter scientific inquiry are visible, then on what grounds could one exclude, for example, creationism? Feminist epistemology that draws on work in science studies has revealed the ways in which it is individuals in communities who know and how such communities operate with a variety of value commitments that make knowledge possible. However, the issue about methodological pluralism remains a difficult one.

a. Feminist Naturalized Epistemologies

Feminist naturalized epistemologies have developed as a way of taking account of the fact that knowers are located in “epistemic spaces” and the ways in which knowledge is more properly understood on a community rather than an individual model. Naturalism is defined here as an approach to epistemology that focuses on causal accounts of knowledge, and in the case of feminist naturalism, these causal accounts also include social, political, and historical factors. Primarily, feminist naturalism seeks to emphasize the ways in which cultural and historical factors can enable, rather than distort, knowledge. Feminist naturalism is itself a rather loosely organized category, with some approaches privileging scientific naturalism and others placing science within the broader scope of human epistemic endeavors. Feminist naturalist approaches by Lynn Hankinson Nelson (1990) and Louise Antony (Antony and Witt 1993) try to develop Quinean naturalism in ways that are consistent with feminist insights about the epistemic relevance of gender and social relations; other feminist epistemologists, such as Elizabeth Potter (1995, 2001), draw on sociological and historical work (in Potter’s case, specifically work on Robert Boyle) to develop naturalistic accounts of theory construction and choice. Work by Alison Wylie (1999) develops feminist naturalistic analyses of the scientific practices of archaeology. The work of Lorraine Code (1987, 1991, 1995, 1996) can also be characterized as a form of feminist naturalized epistemology; this work is discussed in greater detail in the section on Epistemic Virtue Theories below. Nancy Tuana (2003) has developed Charles Mills’s concept of “epistemologies of ignorance” by looking at the ways in which ignorance, rather than knowledge, is constructed by studies of sexuality and public school sex education programs.

Feminist naturalized approaches, like non-feminist naturalized approaches, often come to grief over the status of normativity in the construction of theory, since, traditionally, the naturalistic impulse is to provide a descriptive account of knowledge. However, without an appeal to the ways in which sexism, racism, or homophobia might deform knowledge practices, feminist epistemology would appear to have few resources for arguing that present cultural and historical conditions should be changed, since there is no way to show that these are inherently unreliable or objectionable. Feminist naturalized epistemologies differ in how seriously they take this problem. Some theorists take the challenge presented by this problem very seriously, while others argue that it is only a problem if we assume a strong descriptive/prescriptive or fact/value distinction. Those who take the issue seriously generally offer solutions that either emphasize the value of pluralism in epistemic pursuits or argue that the distinction between the normative and the descriptive is less clear cut than naturalism’s opponents think, thus allowing the feminist naturalist the normative resources that allow for internal critique. Furthermore, feminist naturalists often point out that scientific theories that have been motivated by feminist insights have often turned out to be more empirically reliable than those which claim to be normatively neutral.

b. Cultural Studies of Science

Cultural studies of science begin with the assumption that science is a practice and that practices include both normative and descriptive components that cannot be easily separated from each other. Feminist cultural studies of science emphasize the importance of non-relativistic epistemological commitments and the importance of using revised versions of normative concepts such as “objectivity” and “evidence.” However, they recognize that, insofar as science is a practice, these concepts and their normative import are worked out in practical interactions with the material world, a position that requires that these concepts be revised in ways that are not committed to representational theories of mind and truth. Karen Barad (1999) uses an analysis of the practice of using the scanning tunneling microscope to emphasize the ways in which the boundaries between subject and object are relatively permeable and to show the ways in which observation itself is a form of practice. Her “agential realism” seeks to bridge the gap between descriptive epistemologies and normative epistemologies on the one hand, and between naïve realism and social constructivist approaches to scientific objects on the other.

Donna Haraway’s (1988) work on situated knowledges emphasizes the ways in which science is a rule-governed form of “story-telling” that aims at getting at the truth, but the idea of truth she uses here is not that of reality an sich but a reality that is produced by human material practices. Thus, she argues “facts” are in fact “artifacts” of scientific inquiry. This does not make them false, but it does render them bound up with processes of human production and human needs. Nonetheless, they maintain an ontological independence to a certain extent; this is the central insight of the analogy to other kinds of artifacts.

c. Standpoint Theory

Feminist standpoint epistemology initially developed in the social sciences, primarily in work by Nancy Hartsock (1998) in political science and by Dorothy Smith in sociology. As a methodology for the social sciences, it emphasizes the ways in which socially and politically marginalized groups are in a position of epistemic privilege vis-à-vis social structures. Drawing on Hegel and Marx, feminist standpoint theorists in the social sciences argue that those on the “outside” of dominant social and political groups must learn not only how to get along in their own world, but also how to get along in the dominant society. Thus, they have an “outsider” status with respect to dominant groups that allows them to see things about social structures and how they function that members of the dominant group cannot see.

In philosophy, this theoretical position was developed most thoroughly by Sandra Harding (1986, 1991, 1998). Harding argues that “starting thought out” from the lives of the marginalized will lead to the development of new sets of research questions and priorities, since the marginalized enjoy a certain epistemic privilege that allows them to see problems differently, or to see problems where members of a dominant group do not. However, Harding emphasizes that one need not be a member of a marginalized group in order to be capable of starting one’s thought from that standpoint. She argues that Hegel was not a slave and Marx was not a member of the proletariat, yet they both were able to identify with the standpoint of the slave and with that of the proletariat. Thereby, they were able to start their thought out from lives very different from their own.

The concept of the “standpoint” of the marginalized is both what sets standpoint epistemology apart from a general pluralism as well as the concept that has provided the most challenges to feminist standpoint theorists. One does not occupy the “feminist standpoint,” for instance, simply in virtue of being a woman; the feminist standpoint is an achievement rather than something one is born with. One comes to occupy the feminist standpoint by engaging in critical thought about one’s experience and its relationship to larger social and political structures. By the same token, one need not be a woman in order to occupy the feminist standpoint, since, like Hegel and Marx, one can come to identify with that standpoint. However, the claim that social marginalization confers epistemic privilege seems to depend on a concept of identity that needs to be grounded in the experience of social marginalization, and this has led to charges that standpoint epistemology cannot avoid assuming a great deal of commonality in the experiences of marginalized groups. This has also led to charges that standpoint epistemology must appeal to an “essential” women’s experience or to an “essential” marginalized experience. Such an appeal, implying that there are necessary and sufficient conditions for such experiences, is considered illegitimate by many feminist and postmodernist theorists because they take it to imply that there is something about experience that is “natural” or “given” and that it can serve a foundational role in identity construction. These theorists are suspicious of the claim that there are some experiences that all and only women have that can serve as a basis for identification with that group, arguing that the category of “woman” is either too fractured or too regulative to do the work that feminist standpoint theorists and identity theorists need it to do.

4. Developmental Psychology, Object Relations Theory and the Question of ‘Women’s Ways of Knowing’

Similar charges of “essentialism” have been leveled at feminist epistemologies that draw on developmental psychology and object relations theory to develop epistemic norms. This strand has been more influential in developing feminist moral epistemologies, but it has had some influence on epistemologies developed in tandem with the science studies strain in feminist epistemology as well. Carol Gilligan’s (1982) groundbreaking work in developmental moral psychology in In a Different Voice gave rise to a variety of feminist moral epistemologies that emphasized relatedness and affect to counterbalance the traditional emphasis on moral reasoning as a process of deductive reasoning that takes the reasoner from a moral principle to a particular moral judgment. In a Different Voice raises the issue of whether and how reasoning is tied to the practices of child-rearing, through which children develop gender affiliations and come to live out gendered ideals. Gilligan argues that the moral reasoning processes that take into account relationships in determining the right moral action in a given situation, processes which child development theorists characterized as “immature” or less developed than reasoning processes that operated deductively, are simply complementary and not necessarily inferior. Gilligan’s criticism of Kohlberg’s work, however, ties these reasoning styles to sex: Kohlberg’s studies of moral development and moral reasoning uses boys almost exclusively. The responses that girls give, which often invoke the importance of maintaining relationships when posed with a moral conflict and which emphasize negotiations, are characterized by Kohlberg and his research team as developmentally prior to the deductive reasoning that characterizes the boys’ responses. Gilligan conjectures that girls have more permeable boundaries of the self and are often more concerned with relationship maintenance as a result of their upbringing and that this might account for the different “reasoning styles” that seem to attend gender differences.

Support for this conjecture may be found in object-relations theory. Object relations theory emphasizes the fact that the cognitive distinctions that underlie physical object theory, the process of learning to distinguish between self and other, and the processes of learning language and moral norms all evolve contemporaneously and are tied to each other in a variety of ways such that they re-enforce each other. Coming to learn about objects is connected to coming to learn about what makes one a self and not a thing, and is, thus, connected to theories of mind and intentionality; coming to learn about the persistence of physical objects in time and space depends on developing a sense of an “I” which persists and remains unchanged, even as perceptions change. Feminists emphasize the fact that while all the aforementioned cognitive developments are taking place, the development and re-enforcement of gender ideals and norms is also taking place, overlapping and helping to constitute the cognitive distinctions. Thus, cognitive ideals and virtues come to be saturated with, and partly constitutive of, gender norms and moral norms.

Developmental psychology and object-relations theory, however, are seen by some feminist epistemologists as troublesome, insofar as they assume certain kinds of commonalities in child-rearing that transcend class and race differences. In addition, the claim that women reason differently than men, no matter what the source of that difference, is thought to be both wrong and politically retrograde. However, the virtue of these approaches is that they allow feminist epistemologists to claim that the gender of the reasoner is epistemically significant, which in turn can support the claim that the fact that women are absent from particular studies. Alternatively from the practice of philosophy or science, it means that different ways of thinking about problems or issues may also be missing as a result of that exclusion.

Some of the ways in which the developmental psychology and object-relations strain have contributed to feminist epistemologies in both the sciences and in moral philosophy, however, have relied less on the empirical claims that there are reasoning differences between men and women. These approaches take seriously the ways in which certain aspects of human cognition and reasoning have been tied to women and often devalued as a result, and they take that symbolic relationship as the starting point for epistemic investigation. Along these lines, feminist epistemologists analyze the ways in which testimony operates epistemically while also being embedded in particular social relations that are often opaque to actors and reasoners. Similarly, feminist epistemologies have sought to find a place for affect, relationships, and care in both moral reasoning and in epistemic practices more generally. This branch of feminist epistemology is covered in the section on epistemic virtue theories below.

5. Hermeneutics, Phenomenology, and Postmodernist Approaches

The ways in which Continental philosophical approaches have shaped feminist epistemologies are both complicated and widespread, and even feminist epistemologists who are writing primarily in the Anglo-American tradition have often been influenced by the critical trends in Continental thought. This is true not only of Marxist-feminist epistemologies described above, but it is also true of feminist science studies generally and of feminist epistemologies which draw on developmental psychology and feminist epistemic virtue theory. It is not unusual to find feminist philosophers who are trained primarily in the Anglo-American “analytic” tradition who draw on work in hermeneutics, phenomenology and postmodernism, while feminists who locate their work in these traditions often cross this boundary as well. Similarly, feminist pragmatism (discussed below) often draws on both the Anglo-American analytic tradition and the Continental tradition. It is safe to say that these categories, never stable in non-feminist philosophy, are even more loosely defined in feminist philosophy.

Feminist epistemologies that develop out of the Continental tradition often take as their starting point the need to re-envision and reconstruct the epistemological project more generally. Drawing on Foucault, Gadamer, and Habermas, among others, Linda Martín Alcoff (1993, 1996) argues for a re-orientation of epistemological projects that can take into account the political nature of truth-claims and knowledge production and can provide resources for reconstructing normative epistemic concepts such as rationality, justification, and knowledge.

Continental feminist epistemologies emphasize the ways in which epistemic practices, norms, and products (e.g. knowledge) are not neutral but are, in fact, both produced by, and partly-constitutive of, power relations. However, the claim that knowledge practices and products are not neutral does not amount to the claim that they are false or distorted, since all knowledge practices and products are enmeshed in power relations. The ideal of neutrality, assumed to be essential to good knowledge practices, is, in fact, itself a political construction. Thus, a re-construction of epistemic value terms must be a re-construction that recognizes the political nature of epistemology and epistemic practices. Feminist theorists add to this theoretical approach an emphasis on the ways in which gender is another, and different, layer of power relations.

The other aspect of Continental philosophical traditions that has been used by feminists to introduce and develop an analysis of the epistemic salience of gender has been the phenomenological tradition and its emphasis on the “lived body.” Work by Gail Weiss and Elizabeth Grosz (1994), among others, draws on phenomenology to re-frame epistemological inquiry as well as develops its theory of the body to undermine the oppositional dualisms that Genevieve Lloyd (1984), Susan Bordo (1990), and Susan Hekman (1990) identify as implicated in gender norms and ideals.

Feminist work in the Continental tradition has also led to a critical evaluation of the centrality of epistemology to philosophy and to a concomitant critique of feminists who insist on locating their work in the field of epistemology. A related argument will be addressed below in the section on pragmatist feminist epistemology. The theoretical impetus that comes from the Continental tradition, unlike the one that arises in pragmatism, is connected to the analysis of truth as an instrument of domination, as part of the constitution and maintenance of hegemonic practices, or as a strategic move to eliminate conflict and resistance. This is not a position on which there is agreement among feminist theorists working in the Continental tradition, but the critique of epistemology has been one of the most important developments to come out of feminist engagements with this tradition, and that critique has taken a unique form. Thus, one aspect of feminist Continental epistemology is the attack on epistemology itself, feminist epistemology included.

6. Feminist Epistemic Virtue Theory

Epistemic virtue theories generally focus on the ways in which epistemology and value theory overlap, but feminist versions of these theories focus on the ways in which gender and power relations come into play in both value theory and epistemology and, specifically, on the ways in which subjects are constructed in the interplay of knowledge claims, power relations, and value theory.

Work on the history of philosophy by feminists has led to critiques of philosophical assumptions about what constitutes epistemic virtue, particularly those virtues assumed to be definitive of reason and objectivity. Bordo’s (1990) and Lloyd’s (1984) work examines the ways in which “maleness” and “femaleness” operate symbolically in philosophical discussions of conceptual relationships assumed to be dichotomous, for instance: reason/unreason, reason/emotion, objectivity/subjectivity, and universality/particularity.

These critical engagements with the history of philosophy have laid the groundwork for feminist attempts to reconfigure epistemic virtues in ways that allow for the re-integration of faculties or aspects of knowledge that have been excluded from analyses of epistemic virtue because of their alignment in the “imaginary” of philosophy with women or with the forces of irrationality.

Lorraine Code’s work (1987, 1991, 1995, 1996) argues for the epistemic salience of, among other things, testimony, gossip, and the affective and political operations according to which identities are constructed and maintained. Code and other feminists working in this area emphasize the ways in which social and political forces shape our identities as epistemic authorities and as rational agents and how these, in turn, lead to a different understanding of epistemic responsibility.

Code’s work has also been influential in the development of another strand of feminist epistemology. This strand can be characterized as a version of naturalism [[that]] takes issue with the ways in which traditional epistemological paradigms derive from cases of simple and uncontroversial empirical beliefs. For instance, beliefs like, “I know that I am seeing a tree,” deform the epistemic landscape. This includes a criticism of the paradigm of knowledge as propositional and a related criticism of the presumed individualism of epistemic pursuits. In addition, this naturalistic turn in feminist epistemology takes issue with the traditional epistemological concern with the skeptical problem, in most instances simply ignoring it as an epistemological issue rather than arguing against its importance. The skeptical problem is often taken to be a problem primarily for individualist epistemologies that also assume that knowledge is essentially propositional and that it is to be explained in terms of individual mental states. Since many feminist epistemic virtue theorists reject all or most of these assumptions, the skeptical problem cannot get any traction and is consequently ignored in virtue of its status as a pseudo-problem.

7. Pragmatism and Feminist Epistemologies

For feminist pragmatist approaches, the skeptical problem becomes a non-problem as well, but this is in virtue of the major change wrought in philosophical thinking about knowledge in the wake of Darwin and the pragmatists. Early pragmatists like John Dewey and William James were already recognizing that key terms used in epistemological discourse require revision: terms like “belief” as opposed to “emotion” or “desire,” issues of truth and reference, and representational theories of belief and knowledge are all radically de-stabilized by pragmatist thinkers. Richard Rorty’s development of this theme in the twentieth century led him to conclude that epistemology is dead and that philosophy is the better for it.

Feminist pragmatists share this suspicion of epistemology, although they continue to work on issues related to knowledge. However, theorists like Charlene Haddock Seigfried (1996) argue that since epistemology is importantly tied to terms for which feminist pragmatists have no use, they ought to see themselves as doing something other than epistemology.

Feminist pragmatism has its own version of a naturalized epistemology, but it is a naturalism that, like the naturalism found in feminist epistemic virtue theories, resists reduction to cognitive psychology or neuroscience. Instead, and similar to feminist epistemic virtue theories, it begins with the common problems of knowledge that occur at the crossroads of ordinary experience. Knowledge and its problems present themselves in the same way that other social problems present themselves: as opportunities for melioration and the improvement of life.

The basic epistemic building block for pragmatist feminist approaches is the organism rather than the mind or the body. “Experience” is more complex than sensory states, since it is the way in which the organism interacts with its world, a world that includes not just objects but also social institutions, relationships, and politics. As a result, knowledge pursuits are already implicated with values, politics, and bodies.

Pragmatist feminist approaches to accounts of knowledge, thus, share much with naturalized accounts of epistemology, but the idea of science that operates in feminist pragmatist theories is science as characterized by Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, and John Dewey, rather than the characterization of science as it appears in the analytic tradition of philosophy. There are, of course, differences among Peirce, James, and Dewey in their characterization of science, but it is fair to understand their views as underwritten by an understanding of science as a way of interacting with the world that is also enmeshed in human values and human endeavors. Feminist pragmatist epistemologies share this understanding of science, emphasizing its liberatory project and its role in the melioration of social problems.

Thus, feminist pragmatist epistemological projects attempt to keep our knowledge endeavors true to the liberatory impulse while also re-configuring problems of knowledge in terms that take seriously the insights of evolutionary theory, humanistic empirical psychology, and the understanding of the knowing subject as an organism whose knowledge endeavors are taken up in both a material and a social world.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Alcoff, Linda Martín, Real Knowing (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1996).
  • Feminist coherentist epistemology
  • Alcoff, Linda Martín and Potter, Elizabeth (eds.) Feminist Epistemologies, (New York: Routledge, 1993).
  • Classic anthology
  • Antony, Louise and Witt, Charlotte, (eds.) A Mind of One’s Own: Feminist Essays on Reason and Objectivity (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1993).
  • Classic anthology
  • Barad, Karen “Agential Realism: Feminist Interventions in Understanding Scientific Practices” in the Science Studies Reader, Mario Biagioli, ed., (New York: Routledge, 1999) pp. 1-11.
  • Benjamin, Jessica The Bonds of Love: Psychoanalysis, Feminism, and the Problem of Domination (New York: Pantheon Books, 1988).
  • Feminist psychoanalytic theory
  • Bleier, Ruth Science and Gender: A Critique of Biology and its Theories on Women (New York: Pergamon Press, 1984).
  • Bordo, Susan, The Flight to Objectivity: Essays on Cartesianism and Culture, (Albany: SUNY Press, 1990).
  • Caine, Barbara, Grosz, E, A., and de Levervanche, Marie, Crossing Boundaries: Feminisms and the Critique of Knowledge, (Boston: Allen and Unwin, 1988).
  • Code, Lorraine, Epistemic Responsibility, (Hanover, NH: University of New England Press, 1987).
  • Feminist epistemic virtue theory
  • Code, Lorraine, What Can She Know? Feminist Theory and the Construction of Knowledge, (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991).
  • Code, Lorraine, Rhetorical Spaces: Essays on Gendered Locations, (New York: Routledge, 1995).
  • Collected essays
  • Code, Lorraine, “What is Natural about Naturalized Epistemology?” American Philosophical Quarterly, vol. 33, no. 1, pp. 1-22 (1996).
  • Duran, Jane, Toward a Feminist Epistemology, (Savage, MD, Rowman and Littlefield, 1991.)
  • Duran, Jane, “The Intersection of Pragmatism and Feminism,” Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy vol. 8 no. 2, pp. 159-71 (1993).
  • Duran, Jane, “The Possibility of a Feminist Epistemology,” Philosophy and Social Criticism, vol. 21, no. 4, p. 127-40 (1995).
  • Gilligan, Carol, In a Different Voice, (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982).
  • Grosz, Elizabeth, Volatile Bodies, (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1994).
  • Gunew, Sneja, ed. Feminist Knowledge: Critique and Construct, (New York: Routledge, 1990).
  • An anthology that includes work from feminists drawing on work in twentieth century French and German philosophy to address feminist epistemological issues
  • Haraway, Donna, “Situated Knowledges: The Science Question in Feminism and the Privilege of Partial Perspective” Feminist Studies 14, 575-99 (1988).
  • Haraway, Donna, Primate Visions: Gender, Race, and Nature in the World of Modern Science, New York: Routledge, 1989).
  • Haraway, Donna, Simians, Cyborgs, and Women: The Reinvention of Nature, (New York: Routledge, 1991).
  • Harding, Sandra, The Science Question in Feminism, (Ithaca: Cornell University Press,1986).
  • Harding, Sandra, Whose Science? Whose Knowledge? (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991).
  • Harding, Sandra, Is Science Multicultural? Postcolonialisms, Feminisms, and Epistemologies, (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1998).
  • Harding, Sandra and Hintikka, Merrill (eds.), Discovering Reality: Feminist Perspectives in Epistemology, Metaphysics, Methodology and Philosophy of Science, (Dordecht: D. Reidel, 1983).
  • Early and classic anthology
  • Hartsock, Nancy, The Feminist Standpoint Revisited and Other Essays, (Boulder, CO: Westview Press, 1998).
  • Hekman, Susan, Gender and Knowledge: Elements of a Postmodern Feminism, (Boston: Northeastern University Press, 1990).
  • Keller, Evelyn Fox, A Feeling for the Organism, (New York: W. H. Freeman, 1983.)
  • Early classic work on Barbara McClintock
  • Keller, Evelyn Fox, Reflections on Gender and Science, (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1984).
  • Lloyd, Genevieve, The Man of Reason: “Male” and “Female” in Western Philosophy, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1984).
  • Longino, Helen, Science as Social Knowledge, (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1990).
  • Narayan, Uma, “The Project of Feminist Epistemology: Perspectives from a Non-Western Feminist,” in Gender/Body/Knowledge, Susan Bordo and Allison Jaggar, eds., (New Brunswick: Rutgers University Press, 1989), pp. 256-69.
  • Nelson, Lynn Hankinson, Who Knows: From Quine to a Feminist Empiricism, (Philadelphia: Temple University Press, 1990).
  • Nelson, Lynn and Jack Nelson, (eds.) Feminism, Science, and the Philosophy of Science, (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1996).
  • Potter, Elizabeth, “Good Science and Good Philosophy of Science.” Synthese, 104, p. 423-39, (1995).
  • Potter, Elizabeth, Gender and Boyle’s Law of Gases, (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 2001).
  • Seigfried, Charlene Haddock, Pragmatism and Feminism: Reweaving the Social Fabric, (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996).
  • Tanesini, Alessandra, An Introduction to Feminist Epistemologies (Malden, MA: Blackwell, 1999).
  • Very thorough and useful analyses of different feminist epistemologies
  • Tuana, Nancy, ed., Feminism and Science, (Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press, 1989).
  • Tuana, Nancy, “Coming to Understand: Orgasm and the Epistemology of Ignorance,” Hypatia, 19, 1 (2003) pp. 1-35.
  • Tuana, Nancy and Morgen, Sandra, (eds.) Engendering Rationalities, (Albany: SUNY Press, 2001). Multi-disciplinary anthology
  • Webb, Mark Owen, “Feminist Epistemology and the Extent of the Social,” Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy, vol. 10, no. 3, pp. 85-98, (1995).
  • Wylie, Alison, “The Engendering of Archaeology: Refiguring Feminist Science Studies” in Mario Biagioli, (ed.), Science Studies Reader, (New York: Routledge, 1999) pp. 553-568.

Author Information

Marianne Janack
Hamilton College
U. S. A.

Solipsism and the Problem of Other Minds

Solipsism is sometimes expressed as the view that "I am the only mind which exists," or "My mental states are the only mental states." However, the sole survivor of a nuclear holocaust might truly come to believe in either of these propositions without thereby being a solipsist. Solipsism is therefore more properly regarded as the doctrine that, in principle, "existence" means for me my existence and that of my mental states. Existence is everything that I experience -- physical objects, other people, events and processes -- anything that would commonly be regarded as a constituent of the space and time in which I coexist with others and is necessarily construed by me as part of the content of my consciousness. For the solipsist, it is not merely the case that he believes that his thoughts, experiences, and emotions are, as a matter of contingent fact, the only thoughts, experiences, and emotions. Rather, the solipsist can attach no meaning to the supposition that there could be thoughts, experiences, and emotions other than his own. In short, the true solipsist understands the word "pain," for example, to mean "my pain."  He cannot accordingly conceive how this word is to be applied in any sense other than this exclusively egocentric one.

Table of Contents

  1. The Importance of the Problem
  2. Historical Origins of the Problem
  3. The Argument from Analogy
  4. The Physical and the Mental
  5. Knowing Other Minds
  6. The Privacy of Experience
  7. The Incoherence of Solipsism
  8. References and Further Reading

1. The Importance of the Problem

No great philosopher has espoused solipsism. As a theory, if indeed it can be termed such, it is clearly very far removed from common sense. In view of this, it might reasonably be asked why the problem of solipsism should receive any philosophical attention. There are two answers to this question. First, while no great philosopher has explicitly espoused solipsism, this can be attributed to the inconsistency of much philosophical reasoning. Many philosophers have failed to accept the logical consequences of their own most fundamental commitments and preconceptions. The foundations of solipsism lie at the heart of the view that the individual gets his own psychological concepts (thinking, willing, perceiving, and so forth.) from "his own cases," that is by abstraction from "inner experience."

This view, or some variant of it, has been held by a great many, if not the majority of philosophers since Descartes made the egocentric search for truth the primary goal of the critical study of the nature and limits of knowledge.

In this sense, solipsism is implicit in many philosophies of knowledge and mind since Descartes and any theory of knowledge that adopts the Cartesian egocentric approach as its basic frame of reference is inherently solipsistic.

Second, solipsism merits close examination because it is based upon three widely entertained philosophical presuppositions, which are themselves of fundamental and wide-ranging importance. These are: (a) What I know most certainly are the contents of my own mind - my thoughts, experiences, affective states, and so forth.; (b) There is no conceptual or logically necessary link between the mental and the physical. For example, there is no necessary link between the occurrence of certain conscious experiences or mental states and the "possession" and behavioral dispositions of a body of a particular kind; and (c) The experiences of a given person are necessarily private to that person.

These presuppositions are of unmistakable Cartesian origin, and are widely accepted by philosophers and non-philosophers alike. In tackling the problem of solipsism, one immediately grapples with fundamental issues in the philosophy of mind. However spurious the problem of solipsism per se may strike one, these latter issues are unquestionably important. Indeed, one of the merits of the entire enterprise is the extent that it reveals a direct connection between apparently unexceptionable and certainly widely-held common sense beliefs and the acceptance of solipsistic conclusions. If this connection exists and we wish to avoid those solipsistic conclusions, we shall have no option but to revise, or at least to critically review, the beliefs from which they derive logical sustenance.

2. Historical Origins of the Problem

In introducing "methodic doubt" into philosophy, René Descartes created the backdrop against which solipsism subsequently developed and was made to seem, if not plausible, at least irrefutable. For the ego that is revealed by the cogito is a solitary consciousness, a res cogitans that is not spatially extended, is not necessarily located in any body, and can be assured of its own existence exclusively as a conscious mind. (Discourse on Method and the Meditations). This view of the self is intrinsically solipsistic and Descartes evades the solipsistic consequences of his method of doubt by the desperate expedient of appealing to the benevolence of God. Since God is no deceiver, he argues, and since He has created man with an innate disposition to assume the existence of an external, public world corresponding to the private world of the "ideas" that are the only immediate objects of consciousness, it follows that such a public world actually exists. (Sixth Meditation). Thus does God bridge the chasm between the solitary consciousness revealed by methodic doubt and the intersubjective world of public objects and other human beings?

A modern philosopher cannot evade solipsism under the Cartesian picture of consciousness without accepting the function attributed to God by Descartes (something few modern philosophers are willing to do). In view of this it is scarcely surprising that we should find the specter of solipsism looming ever more threateningly in the works of Descartes' successors in the modern world, particularly in those of the British empiricist tradition.

Descartes' account of the nature of mind implies that the individual acquires the psychological concepts that he possesses "from his own case," that is that each individual has a unique and privileged access to his own mind, which is denied to everyone else. Although this view utilizes language and employs conceptual categories ("the individual," "other minds," and so forth.) that are inimical to solipsism, it is nonetheless fundamentally conducive historically to the development of solipsistic patterns of thought. On this view, what I know immediately and with greatest certainty are the events that occur in my own mind - my thoughts, my emotions, my perceptions, my desires, and so forth. - and these are not known in this way by anyone else. By the same token, it follows that I do not know other minds in the way that I know my own; indeed, if I am to be said to know other minds at all - that they exist and have a particular nature - it can only be on the basis of certain inferences that I have made from what is directly accessible to me, the behavior of other human beings.

The essentials of the Cartesian view were accepted by John Locke, the father of modern British empiricism. Rejecting Descartes' theory that the mind possesses ideas innately at birth, Locke argued that all ideas have their origins in experience. "Reflection" (that is introspection or "inner experience") is the sole source of psychological concepts. Without exception, such concepts have their genesis in the experience of the corresponding mental processes. (Essay Concerning Human Understanding II.i.4ff). If I acquire my psychological concepts by introspecting upon my own mental operations, then it follows that I do so independently of my knowledge of my bodily states. Any correlation that I make between the two will be effected subsequent to my acquisition of my psychological concepts. Thus, the correlation between bodily and mental stated is not a logically necessary one. I may discover, for example, that whenever I feel pain my body is injured in some way, but I can discover this factual correlation only after I have acquired the concept "pain." It cannot therefore be part of what I mean by the word "pain" that my body should behave in a particular way.

3. The Argument from Analogy

What then of my knowledge of the minds of others? On Locke's view there can be only one answer: since what I know directly is the existence and contents of my own mind, it follows that my knowledge of the minds of others, if I am to be said to possess such knowledge at all, has to be indirect and analogical, an inference from my own case. This is the so-called "argument from analogy" for other minds, which empiricist philosophers in particular who accept the Cartesian account of consciousness generally assume as a mechanism for avoiding solipsism. (Compare J. S. Mill, William James, Bertrand Russell, and A. J. Ayer).

Observing that the bodies of other human beings behave as my body does in similar circumstances, I can infer that the mental life and series of mental events that accompany my bodily behavior are also present in the case of others. Thus, for example, when I see a problem that I am trying unsuccessfully to solve, I feel myself becoming frustrated and observe myself acting in a particular way. In the case of another, I observe only the first and last terms of this three-term sequence and, on this basis, I infer that the "hidden" middle term, the feeling of frustration, has also occurred.

There are, however, fundamental difficulties with the argument from analogy. First, if one accepts the Cartesian account of consciousness, one must, in all consistency, accept its implications. One of these implications, as we have seen above, is that there is no logically necessary connection between the concepts of "mind" and "body;" my mind may be lodged in my body now, but this is a matter of sheer contingency. Mind need not become located in body. Its nature will not be affected in any way by the death of this body and there is no reason in principle why it should not have been located in a body radically different from a human one. By exactly the same token, any correlation that exists between bodily behavior and mental states must also be entirely contingent; there can be no conceptual connections between the contents of a mind at a given time and the nature and/or behavior of the body in which it is located at that time.

This raises the question as to how my supposed analogical inferences to other minds are to take place at all. How can I apply psychological concepts to others, if I know only that they apply to me? To take a concrete example again, if I learn what "pain" means by reference to my own case, then I will understand "pain" to mean "my pain" and the supposition that pain can be ascribed to anything other than myself will be unintelligible to me.

If the relationship between having a human body and a certain kind of mental life is as contingent as the Cartesian account of mind implies, it should be equally easy - or equally difficult - for me to conceive of a table as being in pain as it is for me to conceive of another person as being in pain. The point, of course, is that this is not so. The supposition that a table might experience pain is a totally meaningless one, whereas the ascription of pain to other human beings and animals that, in their physical characteristics and/or behavioral capabilities, resemble human beings is something which even very young children find unproblematic. (Ludwig Wittgenstein, Philosophical Investigations, I. § 284).

How is this to be accounted for? It will not do, in this context, to simply respond that a table does not have the same complex set of physical characteristics as a human body or that it is not capable of the same patterns of behavior as a human body. Because the Cartesian position implies that there is no logical connection between the mental and the physical, between the possession of a body of a particular kind and the capability for consciousness. Physical differentiation can and must be acknowledged, but it can play no role in any explanation of what it is to have a mental life.

I am surrounded by other bodies, some of which are similar to mine, and some of which are different. On Cartesian principles such similarities and such differences are irrelevant. The question as to whether it is legitimate for me to ascribe psychological predicates to entities other than myself, which the argument from analogy is designed to address, cannot hinge on the kind of body that I am confronted at a given time. Malcolm, N. (a)).

Assuming the validity of the Cartesian position, we have to infer that it makes as much or a little sense, on these premises, to attribute any psychological predicate to another human being as it does to attribute it to a table or a rock.

On these premises, it makes no sense to attribute consciousness to another human being at all. Thus on strict Cartesian principles, the argument from analogy will not do the work that is required of it to bridge the gulf between my conscious states and putative conscious states that are not mine. Ultimately, it must be confessed that on these principles I know only my own mental states and the supposition that there are mental states other than my own ceases to be intelligible to me. It is thus that solipsism comes to seem inescapable.

If the above argument is valid, it demonstrates that the acceptance of the Cartesian account of consciousness and the view that my understanding of psychological concepts derives, as do the concepts themselves, from my own case leads inexorably to solipsism. However, it may fairly be said that the argument accomplishes more than just this. It can, and should, be understood as a reductio ad absurdum refutation of these Cartesian principles. Viewed from this perspective, the argument may be paraphrased as follows:

If there is no logical connection between the physical and the mental, if the physical forms no part of the criteria that govern my ascription of psychological predicates, then I would be able to conceive of an inanimate object such as a table as having a soul and being conscious. But I cannot attach any intelligibility to the notion of an inanimate object being conscious. It follows therefore that there is a logical connection between the physical and the mental: the physical does form part of the criteria that govern my ascription of psychological words.

4. The Physical and the Mental

What then is this logical connection between the physical and the mental? This question can best be answered by reflecting, for example, on how a cartoonist might show that a particular table was angry or in pain. As indicated above, it is impossible to attach literal meaning to the assertion that a given inanimate object is angry or in pain, but clearly a certain imaginative latitude may be allowed for specific purposes and a cartoonist might conceivably want to picture a table as being angry for humorous reasons.

What is significant in this connection, however, is that to achieve this effect, the cartoonist must picture the table as having human features - the pictured table will appear angry to us only to the extent to that it possesses the natural human expression of anger. The concept of anger can find purchase in relation to the table only if it is represented as possessing something like a human form. This example demonstrates a point of quite fundamental importance: so far from being acquired by abstraction from my own case, from my own "inner" mental life, my psychological concepts are acquired in a specifically intersubjective, social, linguistic context and part of their meaning is their primary application to living human beings. To put this slightly differently, a person is a living human being and the human person in this sense functions as our paradigm of that which has a mental life; it is precisely in relation to their application to persons that we learn such concepts as "consciousness," "pain," "anger," and so forth. As such, it is a necessary and antecedent condition for the ascription of psychological predicates such as these to an object that it should "possess" a body of a particular kind.

Wittgenstein articulated this point in one of the centrally important methodological tenets of the Investigations:

Only of a living human being and what resembles (behaves like) a living human being can one say: it has sensations; it sees; is blind; hears; is deaf; is conscious or unconscious. (I. § 281).

Consequently, the belief that there is something problematic about the application of psychological words to other human beings and that such applications are necessarily the products of highly fallible inferences to the "inner" mental lives of others, which require something like the argument from analogy for their justification, turns out to be fundamentally confused. The intersubjective world that we live with other human beings and the public language-system that we must master if we are to think at all are the primary data, the "proto-phenomena," in Wittgenstein's phrase. (I. § 654) Our psychological and non-psychological concepts alike are derived from a single linguistic fountainhead. It is precisely because the living human being functions as our paradigm of that which is conscious and has a mental life that we find the solipsistic notion that other human beings could be "automatons," machines devoid of any conscious thought or experience, bizarre and bewildering. The idea that other persons might all in reality be "automatons" is not one which we can seriously entertain.

5. Knowing Other Minds

We are now in a position to see the essential redundancy of the argument from analogy. First, it is a misconception to think that we need any inferential argument to assure us of the existence of other minds. Such an assurance seems necessary only so long as it is assumed that each of us has to work "outwards" from the interiority of his/her own consciousness, to abstract from our own cases to the "internal" world of others. As indicated above, this assumption is fundamentally wrong - our knowledge that other human beings are conscious and our knowledge of their mental states at a given time is not inferential in nature at all, but is rather determined by the public criteria that govern the application of psychological concepts. I know that a person who behaves in a particular way - who, for example, gets red in the face, shouts, gesticulates, speaks vehemently, and so forth - is angry precisely because I have learned the concept "anger" by reference to such behavioral criteria. There is no inference involved here. I do not reason "he behaves in this way, therefore he is angry" - rather "behaving in this way" is part of what it is to be angry and it does not occur to any sane person to question whether the individual who acts in this way is conscious or has a mental life. (Investigations, I. § 303; II. iv., p. 178).

Second, because the argument from analogy treats the existence of the mental lives of other living human beings as problematic, it seeks to establish that it is legitimate to infer that other living human beings do indeed have mental lives, that each one of us may be said to be justified
in his confidence that he is surrounded by other persons rather than "automatons." The difficulty here, however, is that the argument presupposes that I can draw an analogy between two things, myself as a person and other living human beings, that are sufficiently similar to permit the analogous comparison and sufficiently different to require it. The question must be faced, however, is how or in what respects am I different from or similar to other human beings? The answer is that I am neither. I am a living human being, as are these others. I see about me living human beings and the argument from analogy is supposed to allow me to infer that these are persons like myself. However, the truth is that I have no criterion for discriminating living human beings from persons, for the very good reason that persons are living human beings - there is no conceptual difference between the two. Since the argument acknowledges that I know living human beings directly, it thereby implicitly acknowledges that I know other persons directly, thus making itself functionally redundant. (Malcolm, N. op. cit.).

A final, frequently-encountered objection to the argument from analogy derives from the work of Strawson and Malcolm: the argument attempts to move inferentially from my supposed direct knowledge of my own mental life and "inner" states to my indirect knowledge of the mental states of others. It thus presupposes that I know what it means to assign mental states to myself without necessarily knowing what it means to ascribe them to others. This is incoherent. To speak of certain mental states as being mine in the first place is to discriminate them from mental states that are not mine and these, by definition, are the mental states of others. It follows, therefore, that in a fundamental sense the argument from analogy cannot get off the ground: one cannot know how to ascribe mental states to oneself unless one also knows what it means to ascribe mental states to others.

Plausible as this objection seems at first sight, it is (ironically, on Wittgensteinian criteria) quite mistaken. For it is not the case that when I am in pain I first identify the pain and subsequently come to recognize that it is one that I, as distinct from someone else, have. The personal pronoun "I" in the locution "I am in pain" is not the "I" of personal individuation - it does not refer to me or discriminate me as a publicly situated person as distinct from others. (The Blue Book and Brown Books, pp. 67-69; also Investigations, I. § 406). The exponent of the argument from analogy is not guilty of the charge of presupposing the very thing that he is endeavoring to demonstrate, as both Strawson and Malcolm suggest. Wittgenstein in fact considered that there is a genuine asymmetry here, in relation to the ascription of psychological predicates to oneself and to others, which is dimly perceived but misrepresented by those who feel the need of the argument from analogy. Whereas one ascribes psychological states to others by reference to bodily and behavioral criteria, one has and requires no criteria at all to self-ascribe or self-avow them. (Investigations, I. § 289-290).

Thus the exponent of the argument from analogy sees, quite correctly, that present-tense, first-person psychological assertions such as "I am in pain" differ radically from third-person psychological predicate ascriptions, but thinks of the former as descriptions of "inner" mental states to which he alone has a privileged access. This is crucially wrong. Such uses of the word "I" as occur in present-tense, first-person psychological assertions do not identify a possessor; they do not discriminate one person from amongst a group. As Wittgenstein puts it,

To say "I have pain" is no more a statement about a particular person than moaning is. (The Blue Book and Brown Books, p. 67; also Investigations, I. § 404.).

To ascribe pain to a third party, on the other hand, is to identify a concrete individual as the possessor of the pain. On this point alone Wittgenstein concurs with the exponent of the argument from analogy. However, Wittgenstein here calls attention to the fact that the asymmetry is not one that exists between the supposedly direct and certain knowledge that I have of my own mental states as distinct from the wholly inferential knowledge which, allegedly, I have of the mental states of others. Rather, the asymmetry is that the ascriptions of psychological predicates to others require criterial justificatory grounds, whereas the self-avowals or self-ascriptions of such predicates are criterionless. It thus transpires that the argument from analogy appears possible and necessary only to those who misapprehend the asymmetry between the criterial bases for third-person psychological predicate ascription and the non-criterial right for their self-ascription or self-avowal for a cognitive asymmetry between direct and indirect knowledge of mental states. The Cartesian egocentric view of the mind and of mental events that gives rise both to the specter of solipsism and attempts to evade it by means of the argument from analogy has its origins in this very misapprehension.

6. The Privacy of Experience

What then of solipsism? To what extent does the foregoing undermine it as a coherent philosophical hypothesis, albeit one in which no-one really believes? Solipsism rests upon certain presuppositions about the mind and our knowledge of mental events and processes. Two of these, the thesis that I have a privileged form of access to and knowledge of my own mind and the thesis that there is no conceptual or logically necessary link between the mental and the physical, have been dealt with above. If the foregoing is correct, both theses are false. This leaves us with the final presupposition underlying solipsism, that all experiences are necessarily (that is logically) private to the individual whose experiences they are. This thesis - which, it is fair to say, is very widely accepted - also derives from the Cartesian account of mind and generates solipsistic conclusions by suggesting that experience is something that, because of its "occult" or ephemeral nature, can never literally be shared. No two people can ever be said to have the same experience. This again introduces the problem of how one person can know the experiences of another or, more radically, how one can know that another person has experiences at all.

Wittgenstein offers a comprehensive critique of this view. He attacks the notion that experience is necessarily private. His arguments against this are complex, if highly compressed and rather oracular. (For more detailed accounts, see Kenny, A., Malcolm, N. (b), Vohra, A.).

Wittgenstein distinguishes two senses of the word "private" as it is normally used: privacy of knowledge and privacy of possession. Something is private to me in the first sense if only I can know it; it is private to me in the second sense if only I can have it. Thus the thesis that experience is necessarily private can mean one of two things, which are not always discriminated from each other with sufficient care: (a) only I can know my experiences or (b) only I can have my experiences. Wittgenstein argues that the first of these is false and the second is true in a sense that does not make experience necessarily private, as follows:

Under (a), if we take pain as an experiential exemplar, we find that the assertion "Only I can know my pains" is a conjunction of two separate theses: (i) I (can) know that I am in pain when I am in pain and (ii) other people cannot know that I am in pain when I am in pain. Thesis (i) is, literally, nonsense: it cannot be meaningfully asserted of me that I know that I am in pain. Wittgenstein's point here is not that I do not know that I am in pain when I am in pain, but rather that the word "know" cannot be significantly employed in this way. (Investigations, I. § 246; II. xi. p. 222). This is because the verbal locution "I am in pain" is usually (though not invariably) an expression of pain - as part of acquired pain-behavior it is a linguistic substitute for such natural expressions of pain as groaning. (I. § 244). For this reason it cannot be governed by an epistemic operator. The prepositional function "I know that x" does not yield a meaningful proposition if the variable is replaced by an expression of pain, linguistic or otherwise. Thus to say that others learn of my pains only from my behavior is misleading, because it suggests that I learn of them otherwise, whereas I don't learn of them at all - I have them. (I. § 246).

Thesis (ii) - other people cannot know that I am in pain when I am in pain - is false. If we take the word "know" is as it is normally used, then it is true to say that other people can and very frequently do know when I am in pain. Indeed, in cases where the pain is extreme, it is often impossible to prevent others from knowing this even when one wishes to do so. Thus, in certain circumstances, it would not be unusual to hear it remarked of someone, for example, that "a moan of pain escaped him" - indicating that despite his efforts, he could not but manifest his pain to others. It thus transpires that neither thesis (i) nor (ii) is true.

If we turn to (b), we find that "Only I can have my pains" expresses a truth, but it is a truth that is grammatical rather than ontological. It draws our attention to the grammatical connection between the personal pronoun "I" and the possessive "my." However, it tells us nothing specifically about pains or other experiences, for it remains true if we replace the word "pains" with many other plural nouns (e.g. "Only I can have my blushes"). Another person can have the same pain as me. If our pains have the same phenomenal characteristics and corresponding locations, we will quite correctly be said to have "the same pain." This is what the expression "the same pain" means. Another person, however, cannot have my pains. My pains are the ones that, if they are expressed at all, are expressed by me. But by exactly the same (grammatical) token, another person cannot have my blushes, sneezes, frowns, fears, and so forth., and none of this can be taken as adding to our stockpile of metaphysical truths. It is true that I may deliberately and successfully keep an experience to myself, in which case that particular experience might be said to be private to me. But I might do this by articulating it in a language that those with whom I was conversing do not understand. There is clearly nothing occult or mysterious about this kind of privacy. (Investigations, II. xi, p. 222). Similarly, experience that I do not or cannot keep to myself is not private. In short, some experiences are private and some are not. Even though some experiences are private in this sense, it does not follow that all experiences could be private. As Wittgenstein points out, "What sometimes happens could always happen" is a fallacy. It does not follow from the fact that some orders are not obeyed that all orders might never be obeyed. For in that case the concept "order" would become incapable of instantiation and would lose its significance. (I. § 345).

7. The Incoherence of Solipsism

With the belief in the essential privacy of experience eliminated as false, the last presupposition underlying solipsism is removed and solipsism is shown as foundationless, in theory and in fact. One might even say, solipsism is necessarily foundationless, for to make an appeal to logical rules or empirical evidence the solipsist would implicitly have to affirm the very thing that he purportedly refuses to believe: the reality of intersubjectively valid criteria and a public, extra-mental world. There is a temptation to say that solipsism is a false philosophical theory, but this is not quite strong or accurate enough. As a theory, it is incoherent. What makes it incoherent, above all else, is that the solipsist requires a language (that is a sign-system) to think or to affirm his solipsistic thoughts at all. Given this, it is scarcely surprising that those philosophers who accept the Cartesian premises that make solipsism apparently plausible, if not inescapable, have also invariably assumed that language-usage is itself essentially private. The cluster of arguments - generally referred to as "the private language argument" - that we find in the Investigations against this assumption effectively administers the coup de grâce to both Cartesian dualism and solipsism. (I. § 202; 242-315). Language is an irreducibly public form of life that is encountered in specifically social contexts. Each natural language-system contains an indefinitely large number of "language-games," governed by rules that, though conventional, are not arbitrary personal fiats. The meaning of a word is its (publicly accessible) use in a language. To question, argue, or doubt is to utilize language in a particular way. It is to play a particular kind of public language-game. The proposition "I am the only mind that exists" makes sense only to the extent that it is expressed in a public language, and the existence of such language itself implies the existence of a social context. Such a context exists for the hypothetical last survivor of a nuclear holocaust, but not for the solipsist. A non-linguistic solipsism is unthinkable and a thinkable solipsism is necessarily linguistic. Solipsism therefore presupposes the very thing that it seeks to deny. That solipsistic thoughts are thinkable in the first instance implies the existence of the public, shared, intersubjective world that they purport to call into question.

8. References and Further Reading

  • Ayer, A. J. The Problem of Knowledge. Penguin, 1956.
  • Beck, K. "De re Belief and Methodological Solipsism," in Thought and Object - Essays in Intentionality (ed. A. Woodfield). Clarendon Press, 1982.
  • Dancy, J. Introduction to Contemporary Epistemology. Blackwell, 1985.
  • Descartes, R. Discourse on Method and the Meditations (trans. F. E. Sutcliffe). Penguin, 1968.
  • Devitt, M. Realism and Truth. Blackwell, 1984.
  • Hacker, P.M.S. Insight and Illusion. O.U.P., 1972.
  • James, W. Radical Empiricism and a Pluralistic Universe. E.P. Dutton, 1971.
  • Kenny, A. Wittgenstein. Penguin, 1973.
  • Locke, J. Essay Concerning Human Understanding (ed. A.C. Fraser), Dover, 1959.
  • Malcolm, N. (a) Problems of Mind: Descartes to Wittgenstein, Allen & Unwin, 1971.
  • Malcolm, N. (b) Thought and Knowledge. Cornell University Press, 1977.
  • Mill, J.S. An Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy. Longmans Green (6th ed.), 1889.
  • Oliver, W.D. "A Sober Look at Solipsism," Studies in the Theory of Knowledge (ed. N. Rescher). Blackwell, 1970.
  • Pinchin, C. Issues in Philosophy. Macmillan, 1990.
  • Quine, W.V. (a) "The Scope of Language in Science," The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays. Random House, 1966.
  • Quine, W.V. (b) "Epistemology Naturalized," Ontological Relativity and Other Essays. Columbia University Press, 1969.
  • Russell, B. Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits. Allen & Unwin, 1948.
  • Strawson, P.F. Individuals, an Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics. Methuen, 1959.
  • Vohra, A. Wittgenstein's Philosophy of Mind. Croom Helm, 1986.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (a) The Blue Book and Brown Books, Blackwell, 1972.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (b) Philosophical Investigations. Blackwell, 1974.

Author Information

Stephen P. Thornton
University of Limerick

Ancient Greek Skepticism

Although all skeptics in some way cast doubt on our ability to gain knowledge of the world, the term "skeptic" actually covers a wide range of attitudes and positions. There are skeptical elements in the views of many Greek philosophers, but the term "ancient skeptic" is generally applied either to a member of Plato's Academy during its skeptical period (c. 273 B.C.E to 1st century B.C.E.) or to a follower of Pyrrho (c. 365 to 270 B.C.E.). Pyrrhonian skepticism flourished from Aenesidemus' revival (1st century B.C.E.) to Sextus Empiricus, who lived sometime in the 2nd or 3rd centuries C.E. Thus the two main varieties of ancient skepticism: Academic and Pyrrhonian.

The term "skeptic" derives from a Greek noun, skepsis, which means examination, inquiry, consideration. What leads most skeptics to begin to examine and then eventually to be at a loss as to what one should believe, if anything, is the fact of widespread and seemingly endless disagreement regarding issues of fundamental importance. Many of the arguments of the ancient skeptics were developed in response to the positive views of their contemporaries, especially the Stoics and Epicureans, but these arguments have been highly influential for subsequent philosophers and will continue to be of great interest as long as there is widespread disagreement regarding important philosophical issues.

Nearly every variety of ancient skepticism includes a thesis about our epistemic limitations and a thesis about suspending judgment. The two most frequently made objections to skepticism target these theses. The first is that the skeptic's commitment to our epistemic limitations is inconsistent. He cannot consistently claim to know, for example, that knowledge is not possible; neither can he consistently claim that we should suspend judgment regarding all matters insofar as this claim is itself a judgment. Either such claims will refute themselves, since they fall under their own scope, or the skeptic will have to make an apparently arbitrary exemption. The second sort of objection is that the alleged epistemic limitations and/or the suggestion that we should suspend judgment would make life unlivable. For, the business of day-to-day life requires that we make choices and this requires making judgments. Similarly, one might point out that our apparent success in interacting with the world and each other entails that we must know some things. Some responses by ancient skeptics to these objections are considered in the following discussion.

(Hankinson [1995] is a comprehensive and detailed examination of ancient skeptical views. See Schmitt [1972] and Popkin [1979] for discussion of the historical impact of ancient skepticism, beginning with its rediscovery in the 16th Century, and Fogelin [1994] for an assessment of Pyrrhonian skepticism in light of contemporary epistemology. The differences between ancient and modern forms of skepticism has been a controversial topic in recent years-see especially, Annas [1986], [1996], Burnyeat [1984], and Bett [1993].)

Table of Contents

  1. Academic vs. Pyrrhonian Skepticism
  2. Academic Skepticism
    1. Arcesilaus
      1. Platonic Innovator
      2. Attack on the Stoics
      3. On Suspending Judgment
      4. Dialectical Interpretation
      5. Practical Criterion: to Eulogon
    2. Carneades
      1. Socratic Dialectic
      2. On Ethical Theory
      3. On the Stoic Sage
      4. On Epistemology
      5. Practical Criterion: to Pithanon
      6. Dialectical Skeptic or Fallibilist?
    3. Philo and Antiochus
    4. Cicero
  3. Pyrrhonian Skepticism
    1. Pyrrho and Timon
    2. Aenesidemus
      1. Revival of Pyrrhonism
      2. The Ten Modes
      3. Tranquility
    3. Sextus Empiricus
      1. General Account of Skepticism
      2. The Path to Skepticism
      3. The Modes of Agrippa
      4. Skepticism vs. Relativism
      5. The Skeptical Life
  4. Skepticism and the Examined Life
  5. Greek and Latin Texts, Commentaries, and Translations
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Academic vs. Pyrrhonian Skepticism

The distinction between Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism continues to be a controversial topic. In the Second Century C.E., the Roman author Aulus Gellius already refers to this as an old question treated by many Greek writers (Attic Nights 11.5.6, see Striker [1981/1996]). The biggest obstacle to correctly making this distinction is that it is misleading to describe Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism as distinctly unified views in the first place since different Academics and Pyrrhonists seem to have understood their skepticisms in different ways. So even though the terms Academic and Pyrrhonian are appropriate insofar as there are clear lines of transmission and development of skeptical views that unify each, we should not expect to find a simple account of the distinction between the two.

2. Academic Skepticism

a. Arcesilaus

Following Plato's death in 347 B.C.E., his nephew Speusippus became head of the Academy. Next in line were Xenocrates, Polemo and Crates. The efforts of the Academics during this period were largely directed towards developing an orthodox Platonic metaphysics. When Crates died (c. 272 B.C.E.) Arcesilaus of Pitane (c. 318 to 243 B.C.E.) became the sixth head of the Academy. Another member of the Academy, Socratides, who was apparently in line for the position, stepped down in favor of Arcesilaus (Diogenes Laertius [DL] 4.32); so it seems he was held in high regard by his predecessors, at least at the time of his appointment. (See Long [1986] for discussion of the life of Arcesilaus.)

i. Platonic Innovator

According to Diogenes Laertius, Arcesilaus was "the first to argue on both sides of a question, and the first to meddle with the traditional Platonic system [or: discourse, logos] and by means of question and answer, to make it more of a debating contest" (4.28, translation after R.D. Hicks).

Diogenes is certainly wrong about Arcesilaus being the first to argue on both sides of a question. This was a long standing practice in Greek rhetoric commonly attributed to the Sophists. But Arcesilaus wasresponsible for turning Plato's Academy to a form of skepticism. This transition was probably supported by an innovative reading of Plato's books, which he possessed and held in high regard (DL 4.31).

Diogenes' remark that Arcesilaus "meddled" with Plato's system and made it more of a debating contest indicates a critical attitude towards his innovations. Diogenes (or his source) apparently thought that Arcesilaus betrayed the spirit of Platonic philosophy by turning it to skepticism.

Cicero, on the other hand, in an approving tone, reports that Arcesilaus revived the practice of Socrates, which he takes to be the same as Plato's.

"[Socrates] was in the habit of drawing forth the opinions of those with whom he was arguing, in order to state his own view as a response to their answers. This practice was not kept up by his successors; but Arcesilaus revived it and prescribed that those who wanted to listen to him should not ask him questions but state their own opinions. When they had done so, he argued against them. But his listeners, so far as they could, would defend their own opinion" (de Finibus 2.2, translated by Long and Sedley, 68J, see also de Natura Deorum 1.11).

Arcesilaus had (selectively) derived the lesson from Plato's dialogues that nothing can be known with certainty, either by the senses or by the mind (de Oratore 3.67, on the topic of Plato and Socrates as proto-skeptics, see Annas [1992], Shields [1994] and Woodruff [1986]). He even refused to accept this conclusion; thus he did not claim to know that nothing could be known (Academica 45).

ii. Attack on the Stoics

In general, the Stoics were the ideal target for the skeptics; for, their confidence in the areas of metaphysics, ethics and epistemology was supported by an elaborate and sophisticated set of arguments. And, the stronger the justification of some theory, the more impressive is its skeptical refutation. They were also an attractive target due to their prominence in the Hellenistic world. Arcesilaus especially targeted the founder of Stoicism, Zeno, for refutation. Zeno confidently claimed not only that knowledge is possible but that he had a correct account of what knowledge is, and he was willing to teach this to others. The foundation of this account is the notion of katalêpsis: a mental grasping of a sense impression that guarantees the truth of what is grasped. If one assents to the proposition associated with a kataleptic impression, i.e. if one experiences katalepsis, then the associated proposition cannot fail to be true. The Stoic sage, as the perfection and fulfillment of human nature, is the one who assents only to kataleptic impressions and thus is infallible.

Arcesilaus argued against the possibility of there being any sense-impressions which we could not be mistaken about. In doing so, he paved the way for future Academic attacks on Stoicism. To summarize the attack: for any sense-impression S, received by some observer A, of some existing object O, and which is a precise representation of O, we can imagine circumstances in which there is another sense-impression S', which comes either (i) from something other than O, or (ii) from something non-existent, and which is such that S' is indistinguishable from S to A. The first possibility (i) is illustrated by cases of indistinguishable twins, eggs, statues or imprints in wax made by the same ring (Lucullus 84-87). The second possibility (ii) is illustrated by the illusions of dreams and madness (Lucullus 88-91). On the strength of these examples, Arcesilaus apparently concluded that we may, in principle, be deceived about any sense-impression, and consequently that the Stoic account of empirical knowledge fails. For the Stoics were thorough-going empiricists and believed that sense-impressions lie at the foundation of all of our knowledge. So if we could not be certain of ever having grasped any sense-impression, then we cannot be certain of any of the more complex impressions of the world, including what strikes us as valuable. Thus, along with the failure to establish the possibility of katalepsis goes the failure to establish the possibility of Stoic wisdom (see Hankinson [1995], Annas [1990] and Frede [1983/1987] for detailed discussions of this epistemological debate).

iii. On Suspending Judgment

In response to this lack of knowledge (whether limited to the Stoic variety or knowledge in general), Arcesilaus claimed that we should suspend judgment. By arguing for and against every position that came up in discussion he presented equally weighty reasons on both sides of the issue and made it easier to accept neither side (Academica 45). Diogenes counts the suspension of judgment as another of Arcesilaus' innovations (DL 4.28) and refers to this as the reason he never wrote any books (4.32). Sextus Empiricus (Outlines of Pyrrhonism [generally referred to by the initials of the title in Greek, PH] 1.232) and Plutarch (Adversus Colotes 1120C) also attribute the suspension of judgment about everything to him.

Determining precisely what cognitive attitude Arcesilaus intended by "suspending judgment" is difficult, primarily because we only have second and third hand reports of his views (if indeed he endorsed any views, see Dialectical Interpretation below). To suspend judgment seems to mean not to accept a proposition as true, i.e. not to believe it. It follows that if one suspends judgment regarding p, then he should neither believe that p nor should he believe that not-p (for this will commit him to the truth of not-p). But if believing p just means believing that p is true, then suspending judgment regarding everything is the same as not believing anything. If Arcesilaus endorsed this, then he could not consistently believe either that nothing can be known or that one should consequently suspend judgment.

iv. Dialectical Interpretation

One way around this problem is to adopt the dialectical interpretation (advanced by Couissin [1929]). According to this interpretation, Arcesilaus merely showed the Stoics that they didn't have an adequate account of knowledge, not that knowledge in general is impossible. In other words, knowledge will only turn out to be impossible if we define it as the Stoics do. Furthermore, he did not show that everyone should suspend judgment, but rather only those who accept certain Stoic premises. In particular, he argued that if we accept the Stoic view that the Sage never errs, and since katalepsis is not possible, then the Sage (and the rest of us insofar as we emulate the Sage) should never give our assent to anything. Thus the only way to achieve sagehood, i.e. to consistently avoid error, is to suspend judgment regarding everything and never risk being wrong (Lucullus 66-67, 76-78, see also Sextus Empiricus, Against the Logicians [generally referred to by the initial M, for the name of the larger work from which it comes,Adversus Mathematikos] 7.150-57). But the dialectical Arcesilaus himself neither agrees nor disagrees with this.

v. Practical Criterion: to Eulogon

The biggest obstacle to the dialectical interpretation is Arcesilaus' practical criterion, to eulogon. Arcesilaus presented this criterion in response to the Stoic objection that if we were to suspend judgment regarding everything, then we would not be able to continue to engage in day to day activities. For, theStoics thought, any deliberate action presupposes some assent, which is to say that belief is necessary for action. Thus if we eliminate belief we will eliminate action (Plutarch, Adversus Colotes 1122A-F, LS 69A).

Sextus remarks that

inasmuch as it was necessary . . . to investigate also the conduct of life, which cannot, naturally, be directed without a criterion, upon which happiness-that is, the end of life-depends for its assurance, Arcesilaus asserts that he who suspends judgment about everything will regulate his inclinations and aversion and his actions in general by the rule of "the reasonable [to eulogon]," and by proceeding in accordance with this criterion he will act rightly; for happiness is attained by means of wisdom, and wisdom consists in right actions, and the right action is that which, when performed, possesses a reasonable justification. He, therefore, who attends to "the reasonable" will act rightly and be happy (M 7.158, translated by Bury).

There is a good deal of Stoic technical terminology in this passage, including the term eulogon itself, and this may seem to support the dialectical interpretation. On this view, Arcesilaus is simply showing the Stoics both that their account of knowledge is not necessary for virtue, and that they nonetheless already have a perfectly acceptable epistemic substitute, to eulogon (see Striker [1980/1996]). But this raises the question, why would Arcesilaus make such a gift to his Stoic adversaries? It would be as if, Maconi's words, "Arcesilaus first knocked his opponent to the ground and then gave him a hand up again" (1988: 248). Such generosity would seem to be incompatible with the purely dialectical purpose of refutation. Similarly, if he had been arguing dialectically all along, there seems to be no good reason for him to respond to Stoic objections, for he was not presenting his own views in the first place. On the other hand, the proponent of the dialectical view could maintain that Arcesilaus has not done any favors to the Stoics by giving them the gift of to eulogon; rather, this "gift" may still be seen as a refutation of the Stoic view that a robust knowledge is necessary for virtue.

An alternative to the dialectical view is to interpret to eulogon as Arcesilaus' own considered opinion regarding how one may live well in the absence of certainty. This view then encounters the earlier difficulty of explaining how it is consistent for Arcesilaus to endorse suspending judgment on all matters while at the same time believing that one may attain wisdom and happiness by adhering to his practical criterion.

b. Carneades

Arcesilaus was succeeded by Lacydes (c. 243 B.C.E.), and then Evander and Hegesinus in turn took over as heads of the Academy. Following Hegesinus, Carneades of Cyrene (c. 213 to 129 B.C.E.), perhaps the most illustrious of the skeptical Academics, took charge. Rather than merely responding to the dogmatic positions that were currently held as Arcesilaus did, Carneades developed a wider array of skeptical arguments against any possible dogmatic position, including some that were not being defended. He also elaborated a more detailed practical criterion, to pithanon. As was the case with Arcesilaus, he left nothing in writing, except for a few letters, which are no longer extant (DL 4.65).

i. Socratic Dialectic

Carneades employed the same dialectical strategies as Arcesilaus (Academica 45, Lucullus 16), and similarly found his inspiration and model in Plato's Socrates. The Socratic practice which Carneades employed, according to Cicero, was to try to conceal his own private opinion, relieve others from deception and in every discussion to look for the most probable solution (Tusculan Disputations 5.11, see also de Natura Deorum 1.11).

In 155 B.C.E., nearly one hundred years after Arcesilaus' death in 243, Carneades is reported to have gone as an Athenian ambassador to Rome. There he presented arguments one day in favor of justice and the next he presented arguments against it. He did this not because he thought that justice should be disparaged but rather to show its defenders that they had no conclusive support for their view (Lactantius, LS 68M). Similarly, we find Carneades arguing against the Stoic conception of the gods, not in order to show that they do not exist, but rather to show that the Stoics had not firmly established anything regarding the divine (de Natura Deorum 3.43-44, see also 1.4). It seems then that Carneades was motivated primarily by the Socratic goal of relieving others of the false pretense to knowledge or wisdom and that he pursued this goal dialectically by arguing both for and against philosophical positions.

ii. On Ethical Theory

But whereas Arcesilaus seemed to limit his targets to positions actually held by his interlocutors, Carneades generalized his skeptical attack, at least in ethics and epistemology. The main task of Hellenistic ethics was to determine the summum bonum, the goal at which all of our actions must aim if we are to live good, happy lives. Carneades listed all of the defensible candidates, including some that had not actually been defended, in order to argue for and against each one and show that no one in fact knows what the summum bonum is, if indeed there is one (de Finibus 5.16-21). He may have even intended the stronger conclusion that it is not possible to acquire knowledge of the summum bonum,assuming his list was exhaustive of all the serious candidates.

iii. On the Stoic Sage

As with Arcesilaus, Carneades also focused much of his skeptical energy on the Stoics, particularly the views of the scholarch Chrysippus (DL 4.62). The Stoics had developed a detailed view of wisdom as life in accordance with nature. The Stoic sage never errs, he never incorrectly values the goods of fortune, he never suffers from pathological emotions, and he always remains tranquil. His happiness is completely inviolable since everything he does and everything he experiences is precisely as it should be; and crucially, he knows this to be true. Even though the Stoics were extremely reluctant to admit that anyone had so far achieved this extraordinary virtue, they nonetheless insisted that it was a real possibility (Luc.145, Tusc. 2.51, Seneca Ep. 42.1, M 9.133, DL 7.91).

As a dialectician, Carneades carefully examined this conception of the sage. Sometimes he argued, contrary to the Stoic view, that the sage would in fact assent to non-kataleptic impressions and thus that he was liable to error (Luc. 67); for he might form opinions even in the absence of katalepsis (Luc. 78). But he also apparently argued against the view that the sage will hold mere opinions in the absence of katalepsis (Luc. 112). Presumably he didn't himself endorse either position since the issue that had to be decided first was whether katalepsis was even possible. In other words, if certainty is possible, then of course the sage should not settle for mere opinion. But if it is not possible, then perhaps he will be entitled to hold mere opinions, provided they are thoroughly examined and considered.

iv. On Epistemology

Just as Carneades generalized his skeptical attack on ethical theories, he also argued against all of his predecessors' epistemological theories (M 7.159). The main task of Hellenistic epistemology was to determine the criterion (standard, measure or test) of truth. If the criterion of truth is taken to be a sort of sense-impression, as in the Stoic theory, then we will not be able to discover any such impression that could not in principle appear true to the most expertly trained and sensitive perceiver and yet still be false (M 7.161-65, see Arcesilaus' "Attack on the Stoics" above). But if we can discover no criterial sense-impression, then neither will the faculty of reason alone be able to provide us with a criterion, insofar as we accept the empiricist view (common among Hellenistic philosophers) that nothing can be judged by the mind that hasn't first entered by the senses.

We have no evidence to suggest that Carneades also argued against a rationalist, or a priori approach to the criterion.

v. Practical Criterion: to Pithanon

According to Sextus, after arguing against all the available epistemological theories, Carneades himself needed to advance a criterion for the conduct of life and the attainment of happiness (M 7.166). Sextus does not tell us why it was necessary for Carneades to do so, but it was probably for the same reason that Arcesilaus had presented his practical criterion-namely, in response to the objection that if there were no epistemic grounds on which to prefer one impression over another then, despite all appearances, we cannot rationally govern our choices. Thus, Carneades expounded his practical criterion, to pithanon.

First he noted that every sense impression exists in two distinct relations: one relative to the object from which it comes, the "impressor", and the other relative to the perceiver. The first relation determines what we ordinarily think of as truth: does the impression correspond to its object or not? The second relation determines plausibility: is the impression convincing to the perceiver or not? Rather than relying on the first relation, Carneades adopted the convincing impression [pithanê phantasia] as the criterion of truth, even though there will be occasions on which it fails to accurately represent its object. Yet, he apparently thought that these occasions are rare and so they do not provide a good reason for distrusting the convincing impressions. For such impressions are reliable for the most part, and in actual practice, life is regulated by what holds for the most part (M 7.166-75, LS 69D).

Sextus also reports the refinements Carneades made to his criterion. If we are considering whether we should accept some impression as true, we presumably have already found it to be convincing, but we should also consider how well it coheres with other relevant impressions and then thoroughly examine it further as if we were cross-examining a witness. The amount of examination that a convincing impression requires is a function of its importance to us. In insignificant matters we make use of the merely convincing impression, but in weighty matters, especially those having to do with happiness, we should only rely on the convincing impressions that have been thoroughly explored (M 7.176-84).

Cicero translates Carneades' pithanon with the Latin terms probabile and veri simile, and he claims that this criterion is to be employed both in everyday life and in the Academic dialectical practice of arguing for and against philosophical views (Luc. 32, see also Contr.Ac. 2.26, and Glucker [1995]). The novel feature of this criterion is that it does not guarantee that whatever is in accordance with it is true. But if it is to play the dialectical role explicitly specified by Cicero and suggested by Sextus' report, then it must have some connection with truth. This is especially clear in the case of sense-impressions: the benefit of thoroughly examining sense-impressions is that we may rule out the deceptive ones and accept the accurate ones. And we may make a similar case, as Cicero does, for the dialectical examination of philosophical views. A major difficulty in interpreting Carneades' pithanon in this way is that it requires some explanation for how we are able to identify what resembles the truth (veri simile) without being able to identify the truth itself (Luc. 32-33).

vi. Dialectical Skeptic or Fallibilist?

Even if the fallibilist interpretation of Carneades' criterion is correct, it remains a further issue whether he actually endorsed his criterion himself, or whether he merely developed it dialectically as a possible view. Indeed, even Carneades' student Clitomachus was unable to determine what, if anything, Carneades endorsed (Luc. 139, see also Striker [1980/1996]). A number of difficulties arise if he did endorse his criterion. First, Carneades argued that there is absolutely no criterion of truth (M 7.159) and that would presumably include to pithanon. Second, Clitomachus claims that Carneades endured a nearly Herculean labor "when he cast assent out of our minds, like a wild and savage beast, that is mere opinion and thoughtlessness" (Luc. 108). Thus it would seem to be inconsistent for him to accept a moderate, fallible form of assent if it leads to holding opinions.

We may more simply deal with Carneades' criterion by noting that sometimes he argued so zealously in support of some view that people reasonably, but incorrectly, assumed that he accepted it himself (Luc.78, Fin. 5.20). Thus we may say that Carneades only advanced views dialectically but remained uncommitted to any of them. His criterion in this case would be the disappointing consequence of Stoic epistemological commitments-disappointing (as in the case with the dialectical reading of Arcesilaus'eulogon) because the Stoics believed these same commitments led to a much more robust criterion.

On the other hand, Cicero endorses a fallibilist interpretation of to pithanon which he seems to think was also endorsed by Carneades himself. This interpretation was developed by another of Carneades' students, Metrodorus, and by Cicero's teacher, Philo. We also have evidence that Carneades made an important distinction between assent and approval that he may have appealed to in this context (Luc. 104, see Bett [1990]). He limits assent to the mental event of taking a proposition to be true and adopts the term "approval" for the more modest mental event of taking a proposition to be convincing but without making any commitment to its truth. If this distinction is viable it would allow Carneades to approve of his epistemological criterion without committing himself at any deeper theoretical level. In other words Carneades could appeal to his criterion for his very adoption of that criterion: it is pithanon but not certain that to pithanon is the criterion for determining what we should approve of. Cicero claims that Carneades made just this sort of move in the case of his rejection of the possibility of Stoic katalepsis: it isprobabile (= pithanon), but not certain, that katalepsis is not possible (Luc. 110, see Thorsrud [2002]).

c. Philo and Antiochus

According to Sextus Empiricus, most people divide the Academy into three periods: the first, the so-called Old Academy, is Plato's; the second is the Middle Academy of Arcesilaus; and the third is the New Academy of Carneades. But, he remarks, some also add a fourth Academy, that of Philo, and a fifth Academy, Antiochus' (PH 1.220). Philo was head of the Academy from about 110 to 79 B.C.E. His interpretation of Academic skepticism as a mitigated form that permits tentative approval of the view that survives the most dialectical scrutiny is recorded and examined in Cicero's Academica, and in the earlier version of this dialogue, the Lucullus. The Lucullus is just one of the two books that constituted the earlier version. The second book, now lost was called Catulus, after one of the main speakers. Cicero later revised these books, dividing them into four; but only part of the first of those four, what is usually referred to as the Academica posteriora, has survived. Nevertheless, we have enough of these books to get a pretty good sense of the whole work (see Griffin [1997], Mansfeld [1997]).

Philo apparently claimed that some sense-impressions very well may be true but that we nonetheless have no reliable way to determine which ones these are (Luc. 111, see also 34). Similarly, Sextus attributes to Philo the view that "as far the Stoic standard (i.e. apprehensive appearance [= kataleptic impression]) is concerned, objects are inapprehensible, but as far as the nature of the objects themselves is concerned they are apprehensible" (PH 1.235, translated by Annas and Barnes). He may have made these remarks in order to underwrite the Academic practice of accepting certain views as resembling the truth; for there must be some truth in the first place-even if we don't have access to it-in order for something to resemble it.

Under the pressure of Stoic objections to his fallibilist epistemology Philo apparently made some controversial innovations in Academic philosophy. Cicero refers to these innovations but doesn't discuss them in any detail (Luc. 11-12), nor did he accept them himself, preferring Philo's earlier view of the Academy and the dialectical practices of Carneades. Philo's innovation may have been to commit himself to the metaphysical claim that some impressions are indeed true by providing arguments to that effect. So rather than rely on the likelihood that some impressions are true he may have sought to establish this more firmly. He then may have lowered the standard for knowledge by giving up the internalist requirement that one be able to identify which impressions are true and adopted instead the externalist position that just having true impressions, as long as they have the right causal history, is enough for one to have knowledge (see Hankinson [1997] for this interpretation, see also Tarrant [1985] and Brittain [2001]).

After Philo, Antiochus (c. 130 to c. 68 B.C.E.) led the Academy decidedly back to a form of dogmatism. He claimed that the Stoics and Peripatetics had more accurately understood Plato and thus he sought to revive these views, including primarily Stoic epistemology and ethics, in his Academy (Cicero examines Antiochus' views in de Finibus 5. Glucker [1978] is a groundbreaking study of Antiochus.).

d. Cicero

Cicero was a lifelong student and practitioner of Academic philosophy and his philosophical dialogues are among the richest sources of information about the skeptical Academy. Although he claims to be a mere reporter of other philosophers' views (Att. 12.52.3), he went to some trouble in arranging these views in dialogue form and most importantly in supplying his own words to express them. In some cases he coined the words he needed thereby teaching philosophy to speak Latin. His philosophical coinages-e.g.essentia, qualitas, beatitudo-have left a lasting imprint on Western philosophy.

He is generally not considered to be an original thinker but it is difficult to determine the extent to which this is true since practically none of the books he relied on have survived and so we do not know how much, or whether, he modified the views he presented. Nevertheless, despite questions of originality, his dialogues express a humane and intelligent view of life. Plutarch, in his biography, claims that Cicero often asked his friends to call him a philosopher because he had chosen philosophy as his work, but merely used oratory to achieve his political ends (Life of Cicero 32.6, Colish [1985] is a comprehensive survey of Cicero's philosophical dialogues, so too MacKendrick [1989], and see Powell [1995] for more recent essays on Cicero's philosophy).

3. Pyrrhonian Skepticism

Pyrrho of Elis (c. 360 to c. 270 BCE), the founder of Pyrrhonian skepticism, is a shadowy figure who wrote nothing himself. What little we know of him comes, for the most part, from fragments of his pupil Timon's poems and from Diogenes Laertius' biography (9.61-108) which is based on a book by Antigonus of Carystus, an associate of Timon. There seem to have been no more disciples of Pyrrho after Timon, but much later in the 1st Century B.C.E., Aenesidemus proposed a skeptical view that he claimed to be Pyrrhonian. Later still in the 2nd Century C.E., Sextus Empiricus recorded a battery of skeptical arguments aimed at all contemporary philosophical views. As with Aenesidemus, Sextus claimed Pyrrho as the founder, or at least inspiration, for the skepticism he reports. The content of these skeptical views, the nature of Pyrrho's influence, and the relations between succeeding stages of Pyrrhonism are controversial topics.

a. Pyrrho and Timon

The anecdotal evidence for Pyrrho tends to be sensational. Diogenes reports, for example, that Pyrrho mistrusted his senses to such an extent that he would have fallen off cliffs or been run over by carts and savaged by dogs had his friends not followed close by (9.62). He was allegedly indifferent to certain norms of social behavior, taking animals to market, washing a pig and even cleaning the house himself (9.66). For the most part we find his indifference presented as a positive characteristic. For example, while on a ship in the midst of a terrible storm he was able to maintain a state of tranquility (9.68). Similarly, Timon presents Pyrrho as having reached a godlike state of calm, having escaped servitude to mere opinion (9.64-5, see also the fragments of Timon's prose works, as recorded by Aristocles, LS 2A and 2B). He was also held in such high regard by his native city that he was appointed as high priest and for his sake they made all philosophers exempt from taxation (9.64). We also find a tantalizing report of a journey to India where Pyrrho mingled with, and presumably learned from, certain naked sophists and magi (9.61, the connection with Indian Buddhism is explored by Flintoff [1980]).

Generally, the anecdotal evidence in Diogenes, and elsewhere, is unreliable, or at least highly suspect. Such reports are more likely colorful inventions of later authors attributed to Pyrrho to illustrate, or caricature, some part of his philosophical view. Nevertheless, he is consistently portrayed as being remarkably calm due to his lack of opinion, so we may cautiously accept such accounts.

The most important testimony to the nature of Pyrrho's skepticism comes from Aristocles, a Peripatetic philosopher of the 2nd Century C.E.:

It is supremely necessary to investigate our own capacity for knowledge. For if we are so constituted that we know nothing, there is no need to continue enquiry into other things. Among the ancients too there have been people who made this pronouncement, and Aristotle has argued against them. Pyrrho of Elis was also a powerful spokesman of such a position. He himself has left nothing in writing, but his pupil Timon says that whoever wants to be happy must consider these three questions: first, how are things by nature? Secondly, what attitude should we adopt towards them? Thirdly, what will be the outcome for those who have this attitude? According to Timon, Pyrrho declared that [1] things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable. For this reason [2] neither our sensations nor our opinions tell us truths or falsehoods. Therefore, for this reason we should not put our trust in them one bit, but we should be unopinionated, uncommitted and unwavering, saying concerning each individual thing that it no more is than is not, or it both is and is not, or it neither is nor is not. [3] The outcome for those who actually adopt this attitude, says Timon, will be first speechlessness, and then freedom from disturbance . . . (Aristocles apudEusebius, Praeparatio evangelica 14.18.1-5, translated by Long and Sedley, 1F).

Let us consider Pyrrho's questions and answers in order. First, what are things like by nature? This sounds like a straightforward metaphysical question about the way the world is, independent of our perceptions. If so, we should expect Pyrrho's answer, [1] that things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable, to be a metaphysical statement. But this will lead to difficulties, for how can Pyrrho arrive at the apparently definite proclamation that things are indefinite? That is, doesn't his metaphysical statement refute itself by implicitly telling us that things are decidedly indeterminate? If we take this view we may defend Pyrrho by allowing his claim to be exempt from its own scope-so we can determine only this much: every property of every thing is indeterminate (see Bett [2000] for this defense). Alternatively, we may allow Pyrrho to embrace the apparent inconsistency and assert that his claim is itself neither true nor false, but is inarbitrable. The former option seems preferable insofar as the latter leaves Pyrrho with no definite assertion whatsoever and it thus becomes unclear how he could draw the inferences he does from [1] to [2].

On the other hand, we may seek to avoid these difficulties by interpreting Pyrrho's first answer as epistemological. After all, the predicates he uses suggest an epistemological claim is being made. And further, Aristocles introduces this passage by noting that we must investigate our capacity for knowledge and he claims that Pyrrho was a spokesman for the view that we know nothing. Bett [2000] argues against the epistemological reading on the grounds that it doesn't make good sense of the passage as it stands. For if we assume the epistemological reading of [1], that we are unable to determine the natures of things, then it would be pointless to infer from that that [2] our senses lie. It would make much more sense to reverse the inference: one might reasonably argue that our senses lie and thus we are unable to determine the natures of things. Some have proposed emending the text from "for this reason (dia touto)" to "on account of the fact that (dia to)" to capture this reversal of the inference. But if we read the text as it stands, we may still explain Aristocles' epistemological focus by pointing out that if [1] things are indeterminate, then the epistemological skepticism will be a consequence: things are indeterminable.

Second, in what way ought we to be disposed towards things? Since things are indeterminate (assuming the metaphysical reading) then no assertion will be true, but neither will any assertion be false. So we should not have any opinion about the truth or falsity of any statement (with the exception perhaps of these meta-level skeptical assertions). Instead, we should only say and think that something no more is than is not, or both is and is not, or neither is nor is not, because in fact that's the way things are. So for example, having accepted [1] (and assuming the predicative reading of "is" in [2]), I will no longer believe that this book is red, but neither will I believe that it is not red. The book is no more red than not-red, or similarly, it is as much red as not-red.

Third, what will be the result for those who are so disposed? The first result is speechlessness (literally, not saying anything)-but this is odd given that we are encouraged to adopt a form of speech in [2]. Perhaps speechlessness follows after initially saying only that things are no more this than that, etc.; then finally, freedom from disturbance follows. Presumably, the recognition that things are no more to be sought after than not sought after is instrumental in producing tranquility, for if nothing is intrinsically good or bad, we have no reason to ever be distressed, or to be exuberantly joyful. But then it seems we would not be able to even choose one thing over another. Pyrrho's tranquility thus begins to look like a kind of paralysis and this is probably what prompted some of the sensational anecdotes.

Diogenes notes, however, that according to Aenesidemus, Pyrrho exercised foresight in his day-to-day activities, and that he lived to be ninety (9.62). So it seems his tranquility did not paralyze him after all. This may be either because Pyrrho (or Timon) was disingenuous about what he was up to intellectually, or more charitably because he followed appearances (9.106) without ever committing himself to the truth or falsity of what appeared. (See "Sextus on the skeptical life" below for further discussion).

b. Aenesidemus

We know practically nothing about Aenesidemus except that he lived sometime in the 1st Century B.C.E., and that he dedicated one of his written works to a Lucius Tubero, a friend of Cicero's who was also a member of the Academy. This has led most scholars to suppose that Aenesidemus was a member of the Academy, probably during the period of Philo's leadership, and that his revival of Pyrrhonian skepticism was probably a reaction to Philo's tendency towards fallibilism. Although this is plausible, it makes the fact that Cicero never mentions him quite puzzling.

i. Revival of Pyrrhonism

Aenesidemus' Pyrrhonian Discourses (Pyrrhoneia), like the rest of his works, have not survived, but they are summarized by a ninth century Byzantine patriarch, Photius, who is remarkable in his own right. In his Bibliothêkê (Bib.), he summarized 280 books, including the Pyrrhoneia, apparently from memory. It is clear from his summary that he thinks very little of Aenesidemus' work. This is due to his view that Aenesidemus' skepticism makes no contribution to Christian dogma and drives from our minds the instinctive tenets of faith (Bib. 170b39-40). Nevertheless, a comparison of his summaries with the original texts that have survived reveal that Photius is a generally reliable source (Wilson [1994]). So despite his assessment of Aenesidemus' skepticism, the consensus is that he provides an accurate summary of thePyrrhoneia. The proper interpretation of that summary, however, is disputed.

Aenesidemus was a member of Plato's Academy, apparently during the period of Philo's leadership. Growing dissatisfied with what he considered the dogmatism of the Academy, he sought to revitalize skepticism by moving back to a purer form inspired by Pyrrho. His specific complaint against his contemporary Academics was that they confidently affirm some things, even Stoic beliefs, and unambiguously deny other things. In other words, the Academics, in Aenesidemus' view, were insufficiently impressed by our epistemic limitations.

His alternative was to "determine nothing," not even the claim that he determines nothing. Instead, the Pyrrhonist says that things are no more one way than another. This form of speech is ambiguous (in a positive sense, from Aenesidemus' perspective) since it neither denies nor asserts anything unconditionally. In other words, the Pyrrhonist will only assert that some property belongs to some object relative to some observer or relative to some set of circumstances. Thus, he will conditionally affirm some things but he will absolutely deny that any property belongs to anything in every possible circumstance. This seems to be what Aenesidemus meant by "determining nothing," for his relativized assertions say nothing definite about the nature of the object in question. Such statements take the form: it is not the case that X is by nature F. This is a simple denial that X is always and invariably F, though of course X may be F in some cases. But such statements are importantly different from those of the form: X is by nature not-F. For these sorts of statements affirm that X is invariably not-F and that there can be no cases of X that exhibit the property F. The only acceptable form of expression for Aenesidemus then seems to be statements that may sometimes be false (See Woddruff [1988] for this interpretation, also Bett 2000).

ii. The Ten Modes

The kinds of conclusion that Aenesidemus countenanced as a Pyrrhonist can more clearly be seen by considering the kinds of arguments he advanced to reach them. He apparently produced a set of skeptical argument forms, or modes, for the purpose of refuting dogmatic claims regarding the natures of things. Sextus Empiricus discusses one such group, the Ten Modes, in some detail (PH 1.35-163, M 7.345, see also Diogenes Laertius' account of the Ten Modes at 9.79-88, and the partial account in Philo of Alexandria, On Drunkenness 169-205, and see Annas and Barnes [1985] for detailed and critical discussion of all ten modes).

The first mode is designed to show that it is not reasonable to suppose that the way the world appears to us humans is more accurate than the incompatible ways it appears to other animals. This will force us to suspend judgment on the question of how these things are by nature, in and of themselves, insofar as we have no rational grounds on which to prefer our appearances and insofar as we are not willing to accept that something can have incompatible properties by nature. If, for example, manure appears repulsive to humans and delightful to dogs, weare unable to say that it really is, in its nature, either repulsive or delightful, or both repulsive and delightful. It is no more delightful than not-delightful, and no more repulsive than not-repulsive, (again, in its nature).

Just as the world appears in incompatible ways to members of different species, so too does it appear incompatibly to members of the same species. Thus, the second mode targets the endless disagreements among dogmatists. But once again, we will find no rational ground to prefer our own view of things, for if an interested party makes himself judge, we should be suspicious of the judgment he reaches, and not accept it.

The third mode continues the line of reasoning developed in the first two. Just as the world appears in incompatible ways to different people, it also appears incompatibly to the different senses of one and the same person. So, for example, painted objects seem to have spatial dimensions that are not revealed to our sense of touch. Similarly, perfume is pleasant to the nose but disgusting to the tongue. Thus, perfume is no more pleasant than not-pleasant.

The fourth mode shows that differences in the emotional or physical state of the perceiver affects his perception of the world. Being in love, calm and warm, one will experience the cold wind that comes in with his beloved quite differently than if he is angry and cold. We are unable to adjudicate between these incompatible experiences of the cold wind because we have no rational grounds on which to prefer our experience in one set of circumstances to our experience in another. One might say that we should give preference to the experiences of those who are healthy, sane and calm as that is our natural state. But in response, we may employ the second mode to challenge the notion of a single, healthy condition that is universally applicable.

The fifth mode shows that differences in location and position of an observed object relative to the observer will greatly affect the way the object appears. Here we find the oar that appears bent in water, the round tower that appears square from a distance, and the pigeon's neck that changes color as the pigeon moves. These features are independent of the observer in a way that the first four modes are not. But similar to the first four, in each case we are left without any rational grounds on which to prefer some particular location or position over another. Why should we suppose, for example, that the pigeon's neck is really green rather than blue? And if we should propose some proof, or theory, in support of it being really blue, we will have to face the skeptic's demand for further justification of that theory, which will set off an infinite regress.

The sixth mode claims that nothing can be experienced in its simple purity but is always experienced as mixed together with other things, either internally in its composition or externally in the medium in which it is perceived. This being the case, we are unable to ever experience the nature of things, and thus are unable to ever say what that nature is.

The seventh mode appeals to the way different effects are produced by altering the quantity and proportions of things. For example, too much wine is debilitating but the right amount is fortifying. Similarly, a pile of sand appears smooth, but individual grains appear rough. Thus, we are led to conclude that wine is no more debilitating than fortifying and sand is no more smooth than rough, in their natures.

The eighth mode, from relativity, is a paradigm for the whole set of modes. It seeks to show, in general, that something appears to have the property F only relative to certain features of the perceiving subject or relative to certain features of the object. And, once again, insofar as we are unable to prefer one set of circumstances to another with respect to the nature of the object, we must suspend judgment about those natures.

The ninth modes points out that the frequency of encountering a thing affects the way that thing appears to us. If we see something that we believe to be rare it will appear more valuable. And when we encounter some beautiful thing for the first time it will seem more beautiful or striking than it appears after we become familiar with it. Thus, we must conclude, for example, that a diamond is no more valuable than worthless.

Finally, the tenth mode, which bears on ethics, appeals to differences in customs and law, and in general, to differences in the ways we evaluate the world. For some, homosexuality is acceptable and good, and to others it is unacceptable and bad. In and of itself, homosexuality is neither good nor bad, but only relative to some way of evaluating the world. And again, since we are unable to prefer one set of values to another, we are led to the conclusion that we must suspend judgment, this time with respect to the intrinsic value of things.

In each of these modes, Aenesidemus seems to be advancing a sort of relativism: we may only say that some object X has property F relative to some observer or set of circumstances, and not absolutely. Thus his skepticism is directed exclusively at a version of Essentialism; in this case, the view that some object has property F in any and every circumstance. A further question is whether Aenesidemus intends his attack on Essentialism to be ontological or epistemological. If it is epistemological, then he is claiming that we simply cannot know what the nature or essence of some thing is, or even whether it has one. This seems most likely to have been Aenesidemus' position since Photius' summary begins with the remark that the overall aim of the Pyrrhoneia is to show that there is no firm basis for cognition. Similarly, the modes seem to be exclusively epistemological insofar as they compel us to suspend judgment; they are clearly designed to force the recognition that no perspective can be rationally preferred to any other with respect to real natures, or essences. By contrast, the ontological view that there are no essences, is not compatible with suspending judgment on the question.

iii. Tranquility

We do not have enough evidence to determine precisely why Aenesidemus found inspiration in Pyrrho. One important point, however, is that they both promote a connection between tranquility and an acceptance of our epistemic limitations (see Bett [2000] for an elaboration of this view). Diogenes Laertius attributes the view to both Anesidemus and the followers of Timon that as a result of suspending judgment, freedom from disturbance (ataraxia) will follow as a shadow (DL 9.107-8). Similarly, Photius reports Aenesidemus' view that those who follow the philosophy of Pyrrho will be happy, whereas by contrast, the dogmatists will wear themselves out in futile and ceaseless theorizing (Bib. 169b12-30, LS 71C). Although there seem to be important differences in what Pyrrho and Aenesidemus understood by our epistemic limitations, they both promoted tranquility as the goal, or at least end product. In general terms the idea is clear enough: the way to a happy, tranquil existence is to live in accordance with how things seem, including especially our evaluative impressions of the world. Rather than trying to uncover some hidden reality, we should accept our limitations, operate in accordance with custom and habit, and not be disturbed by what we cannot know (see Striker [1990/1996]).

c. Sextus Empiricus

We know very little about Sextus Empiricus, aside from the fact that he was a physician. He may have been alive as early as the 2nd Century C.E. or as late as the 3rd Century C.E. We cannot be certain as to where he lived, or where he practiced medicine, or where he taught, if indeed he did teach. In addition to his philosophical books, he also wrote some medical treatises (referred to at M 7.202, 1.61) which are no longer extant.

There are three philosophical works that have survived. Two of these works are grouped together under the general heading, Adversus Mathematikos-which may be translated as Against the Learned, or Against the Professors, i.e. those who profess to know something worth teaching. This grouping is potentially misleading as the first group of six books (chapters, by current standards) are complete and form a self-contained whole. In fact Sextus refers to them with the title Skeptical Treatises. Each of these books target some specific subject in which people profess to be experts, thus: grammar, rhetoric, mathematics, geometry, astrology and music. These are referred to as M 1 through 6, respectively.

There are five additional books in the second set grouped under the heading Adversus Mathematikos:two books containing arguments against the Logicians (M 7, 8), two books against the Physicists (M 9, 10), and one book against the Ethicists (M 11). This set of books is apparently incomplete since the opening of M 7 refers back to a general outline of skepticism that is in none of the extant books of M.

The third work is the Outlines of Pyrrhonism, in three books. The first book provides an outline summary of Pyrrhonian skepticism and would correspond to the missing portion of M. Books 2 and 3 provide arguments against the Logicians, Physicists and Ethicists, corresponding to M 7 through 11. The discussion in PH tends to be much more concise and carefully worded, though there is greater detail and development of many of the same arguments in M. The nature of the relation between these three works is much disputed, especially since the view presented in PH seems to be incompatible with large portions of M (see Bett [1997]).

The following discussion is limited to the views presented in PH.

i. General Account of Skepticism

Sextus begins his overview of Pyrrhonian skepticism by distinguishing three fundamental types of philosopher: dogmatists, who believe they have discovered the truth; Academics (negative dogmatists), who believe the truth cannot be discovered; and skeptics, who continue to investigate, believing neither that anyone has so far discovered the truth nor that it is impossible to do so. Although his characterization of Academics is probably polemical and unfair, the general distinctions he makes are important.

Sextus understands the skeptic, at least nominally as Pyrrho and Aenesidemus do, as one who by suspending judgment determines nothing, and enjoys tranquility as a result. But, as we will see, his conception of suspending judgment is considerably different from his predecessors'.

ii. The Path to Skepticism

According to Sextus, one does not start out as a skeptic, but rather stumbles on to it. Initially, one becomes troubled by the kinds of disagreements focused on in Aenesidemus' modes and seeks to determine which appearances accurately represent the world and which explanations accurately reveal the causal histories of events. The motivation for figuring things out, Sextus asserts, is to become tranquil, i.e. to remove the disturbance that results from confronting incompatible views of the world. As the proto-skeptic attempts to sort out the evidence and discover the privileged perspectiveor the correct theory, he finds that for each account that purports to establish something true about the world there is another, equally convincing account, that purports to establish an opposed and incompatible view of the same thing. Being faced with this equipollence, he is unable to assent to either of the opposed accounts and thereby suspends judgment. This, of course, is not what he set out to do. But by virtue of his intellectual integrity, he is simply not able to arrive at a conclusion and so he finds himself without any definite view. What he also finds is that the tranquility that he originally thought would come only by arriving at the truth, follows upon his suspended judgment as a shadow follows a body.

Sextus provides a vivid story to illustrate this process. A certain painter, Apelles, was trying to represent foam on the mouth of the horse he was painting. But each time he applied the paint he failed to get the desired effect. Growing frustrated, he flung the sponge, on which he had been wiping off the paint, at the picture, inadvertently producing the effect he had been struggling to achieve (PH 1.28-29). The analogous point in the case of seeking the truth is that the desired tranquility only comes indirectly, not by giving up the pursuit of truth, but rather by giving up the expectation that we must acquire truth to get tranquility. It is a strikingly Zen-like point: one cannot intentionally acquire a peaceful, tranquil state but must let it happen as a result of giving up the struggle. But again, giving up the struggle for the skeptic does not mean giving up the pursuit of truth. The skeptic continues to investigate in order to protect himself against the deceptions and seductions of reason that lead to our holding definite views.

Arriving at definite views is not merely a matter of intellectual dishonesty, Sextus thinks; more importantly, it is the main source of all psychological disturbance. For those who believe that things are good or bad by nature, are perpetually troubled. When they lack what they believe to be good their lives must seem seriously deficient if not outright miserable, and they struggle as much as possible to acquire those things. But when they finally have what they believe to be good, they spend untold effort in maintaining and preserving those things and live in fear of losing them (PH 1.27).

Sextus' diagnosis is not limited to evaluative beliefs, however. This is clear by virtue of the fact that he provides extensive arguments against physical and logical (broadly speaking, scientific and epistemological) theories also. How, then, do such beliefs contribute to the psychological disturbances that Sextus seeks to eliminate? The most plausible reply is that any such belief that we find Sextus arguing against in PH is one that will inevitably contribute to one's evaluations of the world and thus will contribute to the intense strivings that characterize disturbance. An examination of a sample of the logical and physical theses that Sextus' discusses bears this out. Many of these beliefs played foundational roles in the Epicurean or Stoic systems, and thus were employed to establish ethical and evaluative beliefs. Believing that the physical world is composed of invisible atoms, for example, would not, by itself, produce any disturbance since we must draw inferences from this belief in order for it to have any significance for us with respect to choice and avoidance. So it is more appropriate to look past the disturbance that may be produced by individual, isolated beliefs, and consider instead the effect of accepting a system of interrelated, mutually supporting dogmatic claims.

iii. The Modes of Agrippa

As a supplement to the Ten Modes of Aenesidemus (as well as his Eight Modes aimed at causal explanations, see PH 1.180-85, and Hankinson [1998]), Sextus offers a set of Five Modes (PH 1.164-77) and Two Modes (PH 1.178-79) employed by "more recent skeptics." We may gather from Diogenes (9.88) that the more recent skeptic referred to is Agrippa. It is important to point out that Sextus merely reports these modes, he does not endorse them at a theoretical level. That is, he does not claim that they possess any sort of logical standing, e.g. that they are guaranteed to reveal a flaw in dogmatic positions, or that they represent some ideal form of reasoning. Instead, we should think of these modes as part of the general account of skepticism, with which the skeptic's practice coheres (PH 1.16-17). In other words, these modes simply describe the way Sextus and his fellow skeptics behave dialectically.

Agrippa's Five Modes relies on the prevalence of dispute and repeats the main theme of Aenesidemus' Modes: we are frequently faced with dissenting opinions regarding the same matter and yet we have no adequate grounds on which to prefer one view over another. Should a dogmatist offer an account of such grounds, the skeptic may then request further justification, thereby setting off an infinite regress. And presumably, we should not be willing to accept an explanation that is never complete, i.e. one that requires further explaining itself. Should the dogmatist try to put a stop to the regress by means of a hypothesis, the skeptic will refuse to accept the claim without proof, perhaps citing alternative, incompatible hypotheses. And finally, the skeptic will refuse to allow the dogmatist to support his explanation by what he is supposed to be explaining, disallowing any circular reasoning. And of course the skeptic may also avail himself of the observation that what is being explained only appears as it does relative to some relevant conditions, and thus, contrary to the dogmatist's presumption, there is no one thing to be explained in the first place (see Barnes [1990]).

iv. Skepticism vs. Relativism

Sextus employs these skeptical modes towards quite a different goal from Aenesidemus'. Aenesidemus, as we have seen, countenances relativistic assertions of the form, X is no more F than not F. This is to say that although X is not really, in its nature, F, it is still genuinely F in some particular circumstance. And it is acceptable for the Aenesidemean skeptic to believe that this is the case. But for Sextus, the skeptical refrain, "I determine nothing" excludes relativistic beliefs as well. It is not acceptable for Sextus to believe that X is F, even with relativistic disclaimers. Instead, Sextus would have us refrain from believing even that X is no more F than not-F. Thus, suspension of judgment extends farther for Sextus than it does for Aenesidemus.

v. The Skeptical Life

So, skepticism is an ability to discover opposed arguments of equal persuasive force, the practice of which leads first to suspension of judgment and afterwards, fortuitously, to tranquility. This makes Sextus' version of Pyrrhonian skepticism dramatically different from other Western philosophical positions, for it is a practice or activity rather than a set of doctrines. Indeed, insofar as the skeptic is supposed to live without belief (adoxastôs), he could not consistently endorse any philosophical doctrine. But how is it possible to live without beliefs?

The short answer is that one may simply follow appearances and withhold judgment as to whether the world really is as it appears. This seems plausible with respect to physical perceptions, but appearances for Sextus include evaluations, and this creates a complication. For how can the skeptic say "this appears good (or bad) to me, but I don't believe that it is really good or bad"? It seems that there is no difference between evaluative appearances and evaluative beliefs.

One possible response to this problem is to say that Sextus only targets sophisticated, philosophical theories about value, or about physics or logic, but allows everyday attitudes and beliefs to stand. On this view, skepticism is a therapy designed to cure the disease of academics and theoreticians. But it seems that Sextus intends his philosophical therapy to be quite widely applicable. The skeptical life, as he presents it, is an achievement and not merely the recovering of a native innocence lost to philosophical speculation. (See Burnyeat and Frede [1997], Brennan [1999] for the debate regarding what the skeptic is supposed to suspend judgment about.)

Any answer to the question about how the skeptic may live without beliefs will depend on what sort of beliefs we think the skeptic avoids. Nevertheless, an elaboration on living in accordance with appearances comes in the form of the fourfold observances. Rather than investigate the best way to live or even what to do in some particular circumstance, Sextus remarks that the skeptic will guide his actions by (1) nature, (2) necessitation by feelings, (3) laws and customs, and (4) kinds of expertise (PH 1.23-24). Nature provides us with the capacity for perception and thought, and we may use these capacities insofar as they don't lead us to dogmatic belief. Similarly, hunger and thirst will drive us towards food and drink without our having to form any explicit beliefs regarding those physical sensations. One need not accept any nutritional theories to adequately and appropriately respond to hunger and thirst. Laws and customs will inform us of the appropriate evaluations of things. We need not actually believe that the gods exist and that they are benevolent to take part in religious ceremonies or even to act in a manner that is (or at least appears) pious. But note that the skeptic will neither believe that the gods exist nor that they do not exist-he is neither a theist nor an atheist, but agnostic in a very robust sense. And finally, the skeptic may practice some trade or profession without accepting any theories regarding his practice. For example, a carpenter need not have any theoretical or geometrical views about doors in order to be skillful at hanging them. Similarly, a doctor need not accept any physiological theories to successfully heal his patients. The further question, recalling the dispute explored in Burnyeat and Frede [1997], is whether the skeptic merely avoids sophisticated, theoretical beliefs in employing these observances, or whether he avoids all beliefs whatsoever.

4. Skepticism and the Examined Life

A unifying feature of the varieties of ancient skepticism is that they are all concerned with promoting, in some manner of speaking, the benefits of recognizing our epistemic limitations. Thus, ancient skeptics nearly always have something to say about how one may live, and indeed live well, in the absence of knowledge.

The fallibilism that developed in Plato's Academy should be seen in this light. Rather than forego the potential benefits of an examination aimed at acquiring better beliefs, the later Academics opted for a less ambitious criterion, one that would give them merely reliable beliefs. Nonetheless, they maintained a thoroughly skeptical attitude towards the possibility of attaining certainty, but without claiming to have conclusively ruled it out.

The more radical skepticism that we find in Sextus' Outlines of Pyrrhonism suggests a move in a different direction. Rather than explain how or why we should trust the skeptical employment of reason, Sextus avoids the problem altogether by, in effect, refusing to answer. Instead, he would suggest that we consider the reasons in support of some particular answer and the reasons opposed in accordance with the skeptical ability so that we may regain tranquility.

5. Greek and Latin Texts, Commentaries, and Translations


  • Long and Sedley, eds. (1987), The Hellenistic Philosophers, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), is a good place to start. These volumes contain selections from the primary sources grouped by topic. See volume 1, sections 68-72 and the following commentaries (pp. 438-488) for readings on Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism, and sections 1-3 with commentaries (pp. 13-24) for readings on Pyrrho. Volume 2 contains the original Greek and Latin texts corresponding to the translations in volume 1.
  • Inwood and Gerson, eds. (1988), Hellenistic Philosophy: Introductory Readings, Indianapolis: Hackett), also contains translated selections from the primary sources for Academic and Pyrrhonian skepticism.
  • Annas and Barnes, eds. (1985), The Modes Of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), is a very useful arrangement and translation of the texts that discuss the different varieties of Pyrrhonian argumentation.

For the Greek edition of Photius' summary of Aenesidemus, see R. Henry, ed. (1962), Photius: Bibliothêque, Tome III, (Paris). For a very readable translation, informative introduction and notes, see N.G. Wilson (1994), Photius: The Bibliotheca, (London: Duckworth).

There have been some recently updated and much improved translations and commentaries on Sextus Empiricus.

  • Annas, J. and J. Barnes (1994), Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bett, R. (1997), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Ethicists (Adversus Mathematikos XI),(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Blank, D. (1998), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Grammarians (Adversus Mathematikos I),(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Greaves, D.D. (1986), Sextus Empiricus: Against the Musicians (Adversus Mathematikos VI), (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press).
  • Mates, B. (1996), The Skeptic Way: Sextus Empiricus's Outlines of Pyrrhonism, Translated with Introduction and Commentary, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Many of the primary texts can be found in the Loeb series, which contains facing pages of text in the original language and translation. Among the most important are (all published by Harvard University Press):

  • Bury, R.G. (1933), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Outlines of Pyrrhonism.
  • Bury, R.G. (1935), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Logicians
  • Bury, R.G. (1936), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Physicists, Against the Ethicists.
  • Bury, R.G. (1949), trans., Sextus Empiricus: Against the Professors. Hicks, R.D. (1925), trans.,Diogenes Laertius: Lives of Eminent Philosophers, vols. 1 and 2.
  • Rackham, H. (1933), trans., Cicero: De Natura Deorum, Academica.
  • Rackham, H. (1914), trans., Cicero: De Finibus Bonorum et Malorum.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Annas, J., (1996), "Scepticism, Old and New," in M. Frede and G. Striker, eds., Rationality in Greek Thought, (Oxford: Clarendon).
  • Annas, J. (1993), The Morality of Happiness, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Annas, J. (1992), "Plato the Sceptic," in J. Klagge and N. Smith, eds., Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, Supp. Vol., 43-72.
  • Annas, J. (1990), "Stoic Epistemology," in S. Everson, ed., Epistemology, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Annas, J. (1986), "Doing Without Objective Values: Ancient and Modern Strategies," in M. Schofield, et. al., eds., Norms of Nature (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Barnes, J. (1990), The Toils of Scepticism, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Bett, R. (2000), Pyrrho, his antecedents, and his legacy, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Bett, R. (1990), "Carneades' Distinction Between Approval and Assent," Monist 73.1: 3-20.
  • Bett, R. (1993), "Scepticism and Everyday Attitudes in Ancient and Modern Philosophy," Metaphilosophy24.4: 363-81.
  • Bett, R. (1989), "Carneades' pithanon: A Reappraisal of its Role and Status," Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 7: 59-94.
  • Brennan, T. (1999), Ethics and Epistemology in Sextus Empiricus, (New York: Garland).
  • Brittain, C. (2001), Philo of Larissa, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Burnyeat, M. (1984), "The Sceptic in his Place and Time," in Rorty, Schneewind and Skinner, eds.,Philosophy in History, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), 225-54, reprinted in Burnyeat and Frede, eds. (1997).
  • Burnyeat, M. and M. Frede, Eds. (1997), The Original Sceptics: A Controversy, (Indianapolis: Hackett).
  • Burnyeat, M., Ed. (1983), The Skeptical Tradition, (Berkeley: University of California Press).
  • Colish, M. (1985), The Stoic Tradition From Antiquity to the Early Middle Ages, vol. 1, (Leiden: Brill).
  • Couissin, P. (1929), "Le Stoicisme de la nouvelle Academie," Revue d'historie de la philosophie 3: 241-76, tr. by Jennifer Barnes and M. Burnyeat as "The Stoicism of the New Academy," in M. Burnyeat, Ed. (1983) 31-63.
  • Flintoff, E. (1980), "Pyrrho and India," Phronesis 25: 88-108.
  • Fogelin, R. (1994), Pyrrhonian Reflections on Knowledge and Justification, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Frede, D. (1996) "How Sceptical Were the Academic Sceptics?," in R.H. Popkin, ed., Scepticism in the History of Philosophy: A Pan-American Dialogue, 1-26, (Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic).
  • Frede, M. (1987), Essays in Ancient Philosophy, (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press).
  • Frede, M. (1983/1987), "Stoics and Skeptics on Clear and Distinct Impressions" in M. Burnyeat, ed., (1983), reprinted in Frede (1987), 151-78.
  • Griffin, M. (1997), "The Composition of the Academica: Motives and Versions" in Inwood and Mansfeld, eds. (1997), 1-35.
  • Glucker, J. (1995), "Probabile, Veri Simile, and Related Terms," in J.G.F. Powell, ed., Cicero the Philosopher: Twelve Papers, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Glucker, J. (1978), Antiochus and the Late Academy, (Gottingen: Vandenhoeck und Ruprecht).
  • Hankinson, R.J. (1998), Cause and Explanation in Ancient Greek Thought, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Hankinson, R.J. (1997), "Natural Criteria and the Transparency of Judgement: Antiochus, Philo and Galen on Epistemological Justification," in B. Inwood and J. Mansfeld, Eds. (1997), 161-216.
  • Hankinson, R.J. (1995), The Sceptics, (London: Routledge).
  • Inwood, B., and J. Mansfeld, Eds. (1997), Assent and Argument: Studies in Cicero's Academic Books, (Leiden: Brill).
  • Long, A.A. (1974), Hellenistic Philosophy: Stoics, Epicureans and Sceptics, (Berkeley: University of California Press).
  • Long, A.A. (1986), "Diogenes Laertius' Life of Arcesilaus," Elenchos 7: 432-49.
  • Long, A.A. (1988), "Socrates in Hellenistic Philosophy," Classical Quarterly 38: 150-71.
  • MacKendrick, P. (1989), The Philosophical Books of Cicero, (New York: St. Martin's Press).
  • Maconi, H. (1988), "Nova non philosophandi philosophia: A review of Anna Maria Ioppolo,Opinione e Scienza," Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 6: 231-253.
  • Mansfeld, J. (1997), "Philo and Antiochus in the Lost Catulus," Mnemosyne 50.1: 45-74.
  • Popkin, R. (1979), The History of Scepticism from Erasmus to Spinoza, (Berkeley: University of California Press).
  • Powell, J.G.F. (1995), Cicero the Philosopher: Twelve Papers, (Oxford: Oxford University Press).
  • Schmitt, C. (1972), Cicero Scepticus, (The Hague: Nijhoff).
  • Shields, C. (1994), "Socrates Among the Sceptics," in P. Vander Waerdt, Ed. (1994), The Socratic Movement, (Ithaca: Cornell University Press).
  • Sihvola, J., ed. (2000), Ancient Scepticism and the Sceptical Tradition, (Helsinki : Philosophical Society of Finland).
  • Striker, G. (1996), Essays on Hellenistic Epistemology and Ethics, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Striker, G. (1990/1996), "Ataraxia: Happiness as Tranquility" Monist 73: 97-110, repr. in Striker (1996), 183-195.
  • Striker, G. (1981/1996), "Uber den Unterschied zwischen den Pyrrhoneern und den Akademikern,"Phronesis 26: 153-71, repr. and transl. by M.M. Lee as "On the Difference Between the Pyrrhonists and the Academics" in Striker (1996), 135-49.
  • Striker, G. (1980/1996), "Sceptical Strategies," in M. Schofield, M. Burnyeat, and J. Barnes, Eds. (1980),Doubt and Dogmatism, 54-83, repr. in Striker (1996), 92-115.
  • Tarrant, H. (1985), Scepticism or Platonism: the Philosophy of the 4th Academy, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).
  • Thorsrud, H. (2002), "Cicero on His Academic Predecessors: the Fallibilism of Arcesilaus and Carneades," Journal of the History of Philosophy 40: 1-18.
  • Woodruff , P. (1988), "Aporetic Pyrrhonism," Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 6: 139-68.
  • Woodruff , P. (1986), "The Skeptical Side of Plato's Method," Revue International de Philosophie 156-57: 22-37.

Author Information

Harald Thorsrud
New Mexico State University
U. S. A.

Contemporary Skepticism

Philosophical views are typically classed as skeptical when they involve advancing some degree of doubt regarding claims that are elsewhere taken for granted. Varieties of skepticism can be distinguished in two main ways, depending upon the focus and the extent of the doubt.

As regards the former, skeptical views typically have an epistemological form, in that they are focused on the epistemic status of certain beliefs. For example, one common variety of skepticism concerns our beliefs about the past and argues that such beliefs lack positive epistemic status - that they are not justified, or are not rational, or cannot constitute knowledge (and perhaps even all three). Where skepticism does not have this epistemological focus, then it tends to be of an ontological form in that it is directed at beliefs about the existence of some supposedly problematic entity, such as the self or God. Here the target of the skepticism is not so much one's putative knowledge of these entities (though it may be that as well), but rather the claim that they exist at all.

As regards the latter, one can differentiate between skeptical views that are either local or radical. Local varieties of skepticism will only concern beliefs about a certain specific subject matter, such as beliefs in abstract objects or the conclusions of inductive arguments. Since ontological varieties of skepticism tend to be concerned with the existence of particular sorts of entities, they are usually (though not always) of this local form. In contrast, radical forms of skepticism afflict most of our beliefs and thus pose, at least potentially, the most pressing philosophical challenge.

Perhaps unsurprisingly, the locus for discussion of skepticism has tended to be radical epistemological varieties of skepticism, and this is certainly a trend that has continued into contemporary debate. In historical discussion, for example, the two most influential forms of skepticism have, arguably, been the radical epistemological skepticism of the classical Pyrrhonian skeptics and the Cartesian form of radical epistemological skepticism that Descartes considers in his Meditations. The former consists of a variety of skeptical techniques that counter any grounds that are offered for belief with grounds for doubt (or at least non-belief) that are at least as persuasive. Since no belief is more reasonable than its denial, the Pyrrhonian skeptics concluded that one ought to be skeptical about most (if not all) of one's beliefs. Cartesian skepticism reaches a similar conclusion, though this time by highlighting through the use of skeptical hypotheses that we cannot be certain of any (or at least hardly any) of our beliefs and thus must retreat to skepticism. Roughly, a skeptical hypothesis is an error-possibility that is incompatible with the knowledge that we ascribe to ourselves but which is also subjectively indistinguishable from normal circumstances (or, at least, what we take normal circumstances to be), such as that we might be currently experiencing a very vivid dream. Since such scenarios are subjectively indistinguishable from normal circumstances, the Cartesian skeptical move is to say that we cannot know that they are false and that this threatens the certainty of our beliefs.

What is common to both of these historical approaches, and which lives on in the contemporary discussion of skepticism, is the primary conception of skepticism as resting on an entirely intuitive and pre-theoretical understanding of our epistemic concepts. In this sense it has the form of a paradox - a series of wholly plausible and intuitive claims that, collectively, lead to an intellectually devastating conclusion. Recent discussion of skepticism also treats the problem as having this paradoxical form, though the epistemic focus of the discussion is now not so much the lack of grounds for belief which counter the skeptic's grounds against belief, or the lack of certainty, but rather the lack of knowledge. Contemporary discussions of skepticism have thus tended to make the radical epistemological claim that we fail to know (hardly) anything.

Table of Contents

  1. The Skeptical Paradox in Contemporary Debate
  2. Relevant Alternatives, Infallibilism, and Closure
  3. Semantic Contextualism
  4. "Hinge" Propositions and Inferential Contextualism
  5. Neo-Moorean Responses to Skepticism
  6. Epistemological Externalism and the New Skeptics
  7. References and Further Reading

1. The Skeptical Paradox in Contemporary Debate

Contemporary discussion of the problem of the radical skepticism has tended to focus on a formulation of that problem in terms of a paradox consisting of the joint incompatibility of three claims, each of which appears, on the surface of things and taken individually, to be perfectly in order. Roughly, they are as follows.

First, that we are unable to know that any one of a number of skeptical hypotheses are false, where a skeptical hypothesis is understood as a scenario that is subjectively indistinguishable from what one takes normal circumstances to be but which, if true, would undermine most of the knowledge that one ascribes to oneself. A standard example of a skeptical hypothesis is the so-called ‘brain-in-a-vat' (BIV) hypothesis that one is being ‘fed’ one’s experiences by computers. If this were true, then most of what one believes about the world would be false (or, at the very least, true in a different way from how one would expect), and thus one would lack knowledge. Moreover, this scenario is characterised such that there would be no perceptible difference between being a BIV and having the non-BIV experiences one currently takes oneself to be experiencing and thus, plausibly, it does not seem to be a scenario that we could ever know to be false. We thus get our first ‘intuitive’ element of the skeptical paradox:

I. I am unable to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses.

The second ‘intuitive' claim about knowledge that the skeptic employs is the following:

II. If I do not know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, then I do not know very much.

What motivates this claim is the compelling thought that unless one can rule-out the kind of error-possibilities at issue in skeptical hypotheses by knowing them to be false, then this suffices to undermine most (if not all) of the knowledge that one traditionally ascribes to oneself. After all, if I were a BIV, then I wouldn't be sitting here now. Hence, if, for all I know, I could be a BIV, surely it must follow that I do not know that I am sitting here now (and much more besides)?

Finally, there is the third element of the skeptical paradox that creates the required overall philosophical tension. This is the highly plausible claim that we do know a great deal of what we think we know:

III. A lot of what I believe, I know.

Of course, there may be lots of abstract and technical kinds of knowledge which I think I have but actually lack, but the point of this intuition is that many of the ‘ordinary' propositions that I believe (such as that I am sitting here now) do seem to be the kinds of propositions that I could not plausibly be wrong about in a wholesale fashion. With these three claims in place, however, the puzzle becomes obvious. For if I cannot know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, and if this lack of knowledge entails that I lack knowledge of most of what I believe, it follows that I must lack knowledge of most of what I believe. Hence, one cannot accept all of these three claims; one of them must go.

The skeptic offers a very simple way out of this puzzle, which is to deny, on the basis of I and II, that we ever have knowledge of the kind of ordinary propositions at issue in III. That is, the skeptic argues as follows:

(S1) I am unable to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses.

(S2) If I do not know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, then I do not know very much.


(SC) I do not know very much.

For example, a skeptical argument which employed the BIV skeptical hypothesis might well run as follows:

(S1*) I am unable to know that I am not a BIV.

(S2*) If I do not know that I am not a BIV, then I do not know very much.


(SC*) I do not know very much,

Clearly, however, this radical skeptical suggestion regarding how we should respond to these three incompatible claims is less of a proposal than a reductio of epistemological theorising. This conclusion is, after all, intellectually devastating, consigning our cognitive activities to, at best, a kind of bad faith. We would thus be wise to look closely at the anti-skeptical alternatives before we accept this (paradoxical) response to the skeptical paradox.

If we are to evade skepticism, we are thus going to have to motivate one (or more) of the following three claims. First, that, despite appearances, we do (or at least can) know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses after all. Second, that, despite appearances, it does not follow from the fact that we lack knowledge of the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses that we thereby lack knowledge of ordinary propositions as well. Third, that, despite appearances, these three claims are consistent after all.

2. Relevant Alternatives, Infallibilism, and Closure

Of the three anti-skeptical strategies just listed, the second looks, prima facie, to be the most promising. After all, this does seem to be the weakest element of the skeptical argument since, although it is at first pass intuitive, on reflection it is far from immediately obvious that our knowledge of everyday propositions should be dependent upon anti-skeptical knowledge in this fashion. One response to the problem of skepticism has thus been to deny this premise in the skeptical argument by arguing that one can perfectly well know everyday propositions whilst failing to know the denials of anti-skeptical hypotheses such as the BIV hypothesis.

One motivation for this line of argument has been to argue that skeptical error-possibilities are just not relevant to everyday knowledge in the way that everyday error-possibilities are. After all, we do not ordinarily demand that agents should rule out skeptical error-possibilities before we ascribe them knowledge. This relevant alternatives (RA) line of argument, which has its roots in work by J. L. Austin (1961), has been developed by Fred Dretske (1970). As Dretske is aware, however, simply denying (S2) of the skeptical argument on these grounds is not enough, rather one needs to also engage with the epistemological theses that underlie this premise and offer a fully-fledged account of what this notion of epistemological relevance involves.

One epistemological thesis that is often thought to provide support for (S2) is that of infallibilism. This is the thesis that, roughly, for an agent to know a proposition that agent must be able to eliminate all error-possibilities associated with that proposition. Provided that one is willing to make the plausible move of construing ‘eliminate' here in terms of the ability to know the negation of then one straightforwardly gets the requisite link between infallibilism and (S2) since the skeptical hypothesis in question (whichever skeptical hypothesis it is) will clearly be an error possibility which must be known to be false if the agent is to have knowledge of the ordinary proposition at issue. Accordingly, an inability to know the denial of the skeptical hypothesis will suffice to ensure that the agent lacks knowledge of the ordinary proposition, just as (S2) says. In effect, infallibilism is the opposing thesis to the RA line because it counts every alternative as being relevant.

Although infallibilism may seem to be an obviously false epistemological thesis, a persuasive case can be made in its defence. In particular, Peter Unger (1971; 1975) has been a prominent defender of a version of infallibilism (although in more recent work, such as Unger (1984; 1986) he has moved towards a thesis which is more in line with contextualism, a view which we will be considering below). In these early works Unger argued that ‘knowledge' is an "absolute term" like ‘flat’ or ‘empty’. According to Unger, what is interesting about absolute terms is that they are never really satisfied, although we often talk as if they are. So, for example, nothing is ever really flat or really empty because, respectively, no surface is ever completely free of friction and no container could ever be a vacuum. Accordingly, even though we may loosely talk of Holland’s ‘flat’ roads or John’s ‘empty’ fridge, reflection indicates to us that such assertions are, in fact, false (Holland’s roads have some bumps on them, however small, and John’s fridge, whilst empty of food, is ‘full’ of air, not to mention refrigerator parts). Similarly, Unger’s point is that what the skeptic is responding to in her arguments is the fact that, strictly speaking, nothing is every really known because to be really known the agent would have to rule out every possibility of error and this is an impossible hurdle to clear (at least for a non-omniscient being). So although we might talk of knowing lots of things, reflection indicates to us, as it does with our use of ‘flat’ and ‘empty’, that our claims to know are all, in fact, false.

We will return to consider infallibilism again below. In the meantime, however, we can set this thesis to one side because there is a (logically) weaker thesis that would also suffice to support (S2). Accordingly, so long as we are able to deny the weaker thesis then we can get a rejection of infallibilism by default. This weaker thesis is the principle that knowledge is ‘closed' under known entailment, or the ‘closure’ principle for short. Roughly, this principle states that if an agent knows a proposition (such as that she is currently seated), and knows that this proposition entails a second proposition (such as that she is not a BIV), then she also knows the second proposition. In general, this can be roughly expressed as follows:

Closure Principle for Knowledge

If an agent knows P, and knows that P entails Q, then that agent knows Q.

Whereas infallibilism supports (S2) by demanding that an agent should be able to know the denials of all error-possibilities, closure merely demands that the agent knows the denials of those error-possibilities that are known to be logical consequences of what one knows. For example, if one knows the ordinary proposition that one is currently seated, and one further knows that if one is seated then one is not a BIV, then one must also know that one is not a BIV. Conversely, if one does not know that one is not a BIV then, given that one knows the entailment in question (which ought to be uncontroversial), one thereby lacks knowledge of the ordinary proposition in question, just as (S2) says. And note that, unlike (S2), the plausibility of closure is not merely prima facie. After all, we reason in conformity with closure all the time in cases where we gain knowledge of previously unknown propositions via knowledge of other propositions and the relevant entailment. Indeed, closure is in this respect far more compelling than infallibilism, since what credibility the latter thesis has is gained by philosophical argument rather than by prima facie reflection on our actual epistemic practice. The theoretical burden imposed upon anyone who advocates the denial of (S2) is thus very strong, since it requires a principled rejection of the intuitive principle of closure.

The standard proposal put forward to support the denial of closure has been some variation of the original RA model advanced by Dretske (1970; 1971; 1981). Essentially, the idea is to claim that knowledge only transfers across known entailments where the entailments in question are ‘relevant'. Thus, knowledge that one is sitting down may transfer across a known entailment to the relevant proposition that one is not standing up, but it won’t transfer across a known entailment to the irrelevant proposition that one is not a BIV. Accordingly, the link between ordinary knowledge and anti-skeptical knowledge required by the skeptic is severed and ordinary knowledge is secured. Dretske himself puts the point as follows:

The general point may be put this way: there are certain presuppositions associated with a statement. These presuppositions, although their truth is entailed by the truth of the statement, are not part of what is operated on when we operate on the statement with one of our epistemic operators. The epistemic operators do not penetrate to these presuppositions. (Dretske 1970, 1014)

In effect, what Dretske is arguing here is that in everyday contexts an agent's acquisition of knowledge of the propositions at issue in that context presupposes the falsity of certain irrelevant error-possibilities. That they are taken for granted is, for Dretske, entirely legitimate (that is, he rejects infallibilism). Nevertheless, the negations of these error-possibilities are often entailed by what is known in that context and thus, if closure held, it would follow that an agent could come to have knowledge of what is presupposed in her knowledge simply by knowing the relevant entailment. It is this that Dretske objects to, arguing that one’s epistemic position regarding the antecedent proposition will not transfer to the consequent proposition where the consequent proposition has performed this ‘presuppositional’ role.

An example will help clarify matters. Consider the following two propositions (adapted from ones adduced by Dretske (1970)):

(P) The animals in the pen are zebras.

(Q) The animals in the pen are not mules cleverly disguised to look like zebras.

Dretske argues that in normal circumstances one can come to know (P) without making any special checks to ensure that the irrelevant error-possibility at issue in (Q) is false. Instead, all the agent needs to do is have evidence that eliminates relevant error-possibilities (such as, for example, evidence to support her belief that it is the zebra enclosure and not the ape enclosure that she is looking at). This is fortunate, because if we demand that the agent must rule-out the kind of error-possibility at issue in (Q) (and thus, one might reasonably assume, know (Q)) before she can know (P), then we will end up setting the requirement for knowledge at a very high level. Indeed, it will be highly unlikely that your average agent would be able to know a proposition like (P) if this demand is made, because the average agent would not be able to tell a zebra apart from a cleverly disguised mule. Nevertheless, Dretske acknowledges that the agent's knowledge of (P) presupposes that the error-possibility at issue in (Q) is false. Here is the crux, however. If we allow closure to stand, then it will follow from the agent’s knowledge of (P), and her knowledge of the entailment from (P) to (Q), that she thereby knows (Q) also, even though we have already granted that the agent in question is not in a position to be able to know such a thing. Dretske puts the point as follows:

If you are tempted to say [that the agent does know (Q) ...], think for a moment about the reasons that you have, what evidence you can produce in favour of this claim. The evidence you had for thinking them zebras has been effectively neutralised, since it does not count toward their not being mules cleverly disguised. Have you checked with the zoo authorities? Did you examine the animals closely enough to detect such a fraud? (Dretske 1970, 1016)

Dretske thus concludes that we should instead allow that an agent might be able to know (P) whilst failing to know (Q), and thus, given that the entailment is known, that closure fails.

This is certainly a very compelling argument, and it does at the very least offer a prima facie case against closure. The job is not quite done, however, because we also need to be given an account of knowledge which will flesh-out this account of relevance. After all, we have strong intuitions that our epistemic concepts do license closure. It is to this end that Dretske (1971) went on to develop his ‘modal' account of knowledge, an account which was adapted and supplemented by Robert Nozick (1981).

What Dretske needs is a theory of knowledge which, whilst being plausible, can also explain how we can know everyday propositions whilst failing to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, even in cases where we know that the everyday proposition in question entails the relevant denial of the skeptical hypothesis. Given these arduous demands, his proposal is, to say the least, ingenious. In essence, what Dretske does is to adduce a modal condition on knowledge, what I will call ‘Dretskean Sensitivity', that can be roughly expressed as follows:

Dretskean Sensitivity

If P were not true, then the agent would not believe P.

The basic idea behind Dretskean Sensitivity is that for a belief to count as knowledge it must at least ‘track' the truth in the sense that, not only is it true but, had what is believed been false, the agent would not have believed it. With this condition in play, Dretske can get the result he wants.

Suppose the actual world is pretty much as I take it to be. It follows that my belief that I am currently in my office and my belief that I am not a BIV are both true. Now consider whether the former belief counts as an instance of knowledge. On this account it does (at least pending any further conditions that one wants to add to Dretskean Sensitivity), because in the nearest possible world in which I am not in my office - the world in which, for example, I am in the corridor outside my office - I no longer believe that I am. My belief thus ‘tracks' the truth adequately to be a candidate for knowledge. In contrast, consider my belief that I am not a BIV. The problem with this belief is that in the nearest possible world in which this belief is false (that is, the BIV-world), I continue to have a belief that I am not a BIV because in this world I am the victim of a widespread deception. Accordingly, this belief fails to meet necessary condition for knowledge set out in Dretskean Sensitivity and thus is not even in the running to be an instance of knowledge.

Dretske can thus use Dretskean Sensitivity to explain why closure fails by showing how knowledge needs to be understood relative to a certain relevant range of possible worlds which is variable depending upon the proposition at issue. As a result, one can know one proposition relative to one set of possible worlds, know the entailment to a second proposition, and yet fail to know the second proposition relative to a different set of possible worlds. More specifically, one can have knowledge of everyday propositions relative to one set of possible worlds that is ‘near-to' the actual world, know that it entails the denial of a skeptical hypothesis, and yet lack knowledge of the denial of the skeptical hypothesis because knowledge is here relative to the ‘far-off’ possible worlds that are quite unlike the actual world. The notion of ‘relevance’ at issue in the basic RA account is thus cashed-out in explicitly modal terms. Moreover, since a number of logical principles fail in modal contexts because of this sort of variability, it should not come as much of a surprise to find that closure meets a similar fate. Dretske is thus in a position to offer a plausible account of knowledge that can accommodate all of the claims that we saw him wanting to make earlier.

This conception of knowledge, along with the later more elaborate version advanced by Nozick (1981), has been extremely influential. It is worth noting, however, that it is an epistemologically revisionist anti-skeptical proposal because it results in the denial of the highly plausible principle of closure. With this in mind, there is a prima facie tension involved in adopting such a proposal, despite the compelling defence of this position that Dretske, Nozick and others have offered. After all, the idea that we must know the known consequences of what we know is extremely strong and the rejection of this claim cannot be taken lightly. As Keith DeRose (1995, §5), has pointed out, dropping closure means allowing what he calls "abominable conjunctions", such as that one knows that one has two hands but one does not know that one is not a BIV. That closure should hold has been one of the main motivations for alternative interpretations of the core RA anti-skeptical thesis that do not result in the rejection of closure, as we will see in a moment.

Besides this line of criticism against the Dretske-Nozick account, a number of other claims have been made. I will focus here on those avenues of critique that are directed at the view presented as an anti-skeptical proposal, rather than as an analysis (albeit perhaps only a partial one) of knowledge. Edward Craig (1989; 1990), for instance, has argued that the Dretske-Nozick proposal is either impotent at meeting skeptical arguments or unnecessary. After all, the strategy only works on the assumption that skeptical possible worlds are indeed far-off worlds, and Craig argues that if we are entitled to that supposition then we have no need of an anti-skeptical strategy. Conversely, if we are not entitled to that supposition, then the modal analysis of knowledge offered by Dretske and Nozick leaves us in an impasse with the skeptic which is no better than we were in before. That is, all that the Dretskean approach will have achieved is to show us that, provided the world is in fact pretty much as we take it to be, then skepticism is false and this still leaves the issue of whether the world is in fact pretty much as we take it to be unresolved.

Craig's objection is surely wrong, however, because the skeptical argument purported to show that knowledge was impossible, and the Dretske-Nozick account at least refutes this claim by showing that knowledge is possible; that we can have knowledge provided that certain conditions obtain. What is true, however, is that there is nothing in the Dretske-Nozick line which demands that the agent should be able to become reflectively aware that we have met these conditions if we are to have knowledge, and this ‘externalist’ element of the view may well be problematic. For if this is the case then the existential force of skepticism - that we could indeed, for all we can tell, be a victim of a skeptical hypothesis - is just as powerful as ever. The worry here is that there is always going to be something intellectually unsatisfactory about an anti-skeptical proposal that is run along epistemologically externalist lines. We will consider the role of epistemological externalism and internalism in the skeptical debate in more detail below, since it raises issues which impact upon all anti-skeptical proposals, regardless of whether they retain closure.

The large body of critical appraisal of the Dretskean proposal falls, however, on the rejection of the closure principle, closure. There are two ways in which this critique is often run. Either critics argue directly for the retention of closure and thereby against the Dretskean line by default, or else they try to offer an alternative construal of the motivation for the Dretskean line that retains closure. Peter Klein (1981; 1995) is a good representative of the former position, arguing that, contra Dretske, we can indeed come to know (/be justified in believing) that the animal in the pen is not a cleverly disguised mule on the basis of our knowledge (/justified true belief) that it is a zebra and our knowledge of the entailment. Central to Klein's view is a commitment to epistemological internalism, whose role in the skeptical debate will be discussed below, and a certain view about the structure of reasons that we do not have the space to go into here. The most interesting attacks on the Dretskean approach to closure do not come from this quarter, however, but from those who claim to be motivated by similar epistemological concerns as those which motivate Dretske himself. After all, that one who endorses a radically different conception of the epistemological landscape should not find the Dretskean proposal plausible is not nearly so intriguing as dissent from those who sign-up to many of the key Dretskean claims. In particular, it is interesting to note that two of the main rival views to the Dretskean line are wrought out of the same basic RA claims.

Consider again the core RA thought. This is was that certain error-possibilities are irrelevant to the determination of knowledge, and thus that one can have knowledge merely by eliminating the salient error-possibilities. With this characterisation of the core RA thesis in mind, the natural question to ask is why the core RA thought should be spelt-out along Dretskean lines. After all, the Dretskean line does take far-off skeptical possible worlds to be relevant to the determination of knowledge (albeit only knowledge of anti-skeptical propositions), whereas the basic RA idea was surely that such far-off worlds were manifestly irrelevant to the determination of knowledge (any knowledge). There thus seems to be an ambiguity in the RA thesis. Either we take it as meaning that relevance is determined by the nearest not-P world (no matter how far-out that might be), and thus end up with the thesis that Dretske and Nozick propose, or else we construe it as simply demanding that only near-by possible worlds are relevant worlds. This is no mere technical dispute either, since a great deal hangs upon which alternative we adopt.

After all, if we adopt the latter reading of the core RA thesis then we are left with the thought that knowledge possession only requires tracking the truth in near-by possible worlds and on this construal the motivation for denying closure fades. For not only will an agent's belief in an everyday proposition typically track the truth in near-by possible worlds, so will her belief that she is not a BIV (since she is, by hypothesis, not a BIV in any near-by world). Admittedly, this belief will not track the truth in the nearest possible world in which she is a BIV, but since this possible world is far-off, this fact alone should not suffice on this construal of the RA thesis to undermine her knowledge. An entirely different reading of the core RA thesis thus seems to license the denial of the first premise of the skeptical argument, (S1) - that we are unable to know the denials of skeptical hypotheses - rather than the denial of closure and thus the rejection of the second premise, (S2). Moreover, that this reading of the RA thesis does not result in the failure of closure means that it does possess some considerable dialectical advantage over the Dretske-Nozick thesis.

We will consider how such an approach to skepticism might function in more detail below. First, however, we will look at a different reading of the core RA thesis that also does not result in the denial of closure. Where this line differs from the one just canvassed is that it does not straightforwardly allow that one can know the denials of skeptical hypotheses either. Instead, it argues that the standards for relevance are variable such that, although one knows everyday propositions and thus the denials of skeptical hypotheses relative to a low standard of relevance, one lacks knowledge of these everyday propositions and thus of the denials of skeptical hypotheses at high standards of relevance. In this way, the hope is that this thesis can explain both our skeptical and anti-skeptical intuitions (and our attachment to closure), whilst nevertheless denying the universal correctness of the skeptical argument. This anti-skeptical thesis is contextualism, and since the version that we will be considering regards the mechanisms that alter these standards of relevance to be conversational mechanisms, we will call it semantic contextualism.

3. Semantic Contextualism

Semantic contextualism - as put forward by such figures as Stewart Cohen (1987; 1988; 1991; 1999; 2000), DeRose (1995) and David Lewis (1996) - is without doubt the most dominant form of anti-skeptical theory in the current literature. In essence, this view maintains that skeptical arguments only seem to work because they exploit the way in which the correct employment of our epistemic concepts (such as knowledge) can be influenced by features of the conversational context. More specifically, semantic contextualists argue that the standards for knowledge possession fluctuate depending on what is at issue in that conversational context. Accordingly, they are in a position to allow that both skepticism and anti-skepticism could, in a restricted sense, be true. In skeptical conversational contexts where the standards are high, the skeptical conclusion that we know very little will be true. In contrast, in non-skeptical conversational contexts where the standards will be relatively low, we are in a position to know much of what we think we know, albeit only to this low epistemic standard.

In what follows, I will primarily focus my explication of the semantic contextualist thesis by looking at DeRose's version since this is the most developed (and, arguably, the most influential) characterisation of the thesis which incorporates most of the main features of the other two accounts. Later on, however, I’ll mention some of the key differences between these three versions of the semantic contextualist view. Moreover, in §4, I will be looking at a different type of contextualist theory that is advanced by Michael Williams (1991) - what I call inferential contextualism - which does not conform to the basic semantic contextualist template.

Before we look at the DeRose version of the semantic contextualist thesis, however, it is worthwhile first being clear about the following supposed features of the ‘phenomenology' of our engagement with skepticism since semantic contextualism can most naturally be viewed as a response, and to some extent as an accommodation, of these features:

I. Ascriptions of knowledge to subjects in conversational contexts in which skeptical error-

possibilities have been raised seems improper.

II. In conversational contexts in which no skeptical error-possibilities are in play it seems perfectly appropriate to ascribe knowledge to subjects.

III. All that may change when one moves from a non-skeptical conversational context to a skeptical context are mere conversational factors.

The first two features represent what Williams (1991, chapter one) refers to as our ‘biperspectivalism', our intuition that skepticism is compelling under the conditions of philosophical reflection but never able to impact on everyday life where it is all but ignored. The third feature creates the tension because it highlights our sense that one of these judgements must be wrong. That is, since conversational topic has no obvious bearing on the epistemic status of a subject’s beliefs, that it ought to be universally true (that is, whatever the conversational context) that the subject either does or does not know the propositions in question. So either our knowledge ascriptions in everyday contexts are right (and thus the skeptic is wrong), in which case we shouldn’t take skepticism so seriously in conversational contexts in which skepticism is at issue; or else the skeptic is right, and thus our everyday practice of ascribing knowledge is under threat. Semantic contextualism opposes this thought with the suggestion that what is actually occurring is not a contradiction but a responsiveness, on the part of the attributor of knowledge, to a fluctuation in the epistemic standards (and with them the subject’s possession of knowledge) caused by a change in the conversational context. In effect, and contra the third claim listed above, semantic contextualism holds that mere changes in the conversational context can have an effect on the epistemic status of one’s beliefs so that it can be true both that one has knowledge in everyday contexts whilst lacking it in skeptical conversational contexts.

Accordingly, we find DeRose (1995) arguing that the basic contextualist strategy pivots upon the acceptability, and appropriate use, of the following contextualist thesis:

Suppose a speaker A (for "attributor") says, "S knows that P", of a subject S's true belief that P. According to contextualist theories of knowledge attributions, how strong an epistemic position S must be in with respect to P for A’s assertion to be true can vary according to features of A’s conversational context. (DeRose 1995, 4)

Here we get the essentials of the semantic contextualist view. In particular, we get (i) the claim that the strength of epistemic position that an agent needs to be in if she is to have knowledge can fluctuate from context to context (which makes the thesis contextualist); and (ii) the claim that what is at issue in the determination of contexts in this respect is the conversational context (which makes the contextualist thesis semantic). The interesting question now is how the details of how this account is to function are to be spelt-out.

The first thing that DeRose tries to capture is the intuition that as one moves from one conversational context to another one's epistemic situation (one’s total informational state for instance) could remain exactly the same. DeRose accommodates this intuition in conjunction with the contextualist picture by arguing, as the above quotation indicates, that although one’s "epistemic position" is constant at any one time, the epistemic position that one needs to be in so as to count as possessing knowledge can be variable. Strength of "epistemic position" is characterised by DeRose as follows:

[...] being in a strong epistemic position with respect to P is to have a belief as to whether P is true match the fact of the matter as to whether P is true, not only in the actual world, but also at the worlds sufficiently close to the actual world. That is, one's belief should not only be true, but also should be non-accidentally true, where this requires one’s belief as to whether P is true to match the fact of the matter at nearby worlds. The further away one gets from the actual world, while still having it be the case that one’s belief matches the fact at worlds that far away and closer, the stronger a position one is in with respect to P. (DeRose 1995, 34)

In order to see this, imagine that Lars believes that his car is outside on the basis of a certain fixed informational state (which involves, perhaps, his memory of the car being there a few hours ago, his grounds for believing that no-one would steal it, and so forth). Now imagine an (almost) exact counterpart of Lars - Lars* - who is in exactly the same cognitive state except that he has the extra piece of information that the car was there a minute ago (perhaps he looked). Clearly, Lars* will be in a slightly better epistemic position with respect to his belief that his car is outside than Lars. Although they will, in general, track the truth across the same set of possible worlds, Lars* will track the truth in a few extra possible worlds, such as the possible worlds in which his car was stolen ten minutes ago.

DeRose then goes on to describe the mechanism which changes the conversational context (and thereby alters the epistemic standards at play) in terms of the thesis of Dretskean Sensitivity that we saw above. Recall that for an agent to have a belief in P that is sensitive in this way, the agent must not only have a true belief in P in the actual world, but also not believe P in the nearest possible world (or worlds) in which P is false. DeRose's thought is that in any particular conversational context there is a certain set of propositions that are explicitly at issue and that the agent must, at the very least, be sensitive to all these ‘explicit’ propositions if she is to know them. Moreover, the most demanding of these propositions - the proposition which has a negation that occupies the furthest-out possible world - will set the standard for that conversational context since this not-P world will determine the extent of possible worlds that one’s beliefs must be able to track if one is to be truly said to know a proposition in that context. Knowing a proposition thus involves being in an epistemic position sufficient to track the truth across the range of possible worlds determined by the most demanding proposition explicit to that context. Crucially, however (and I will be expanding upon this detail in a moment), this point also applies to propositions which are implicit to a conversational context (that is, propositions which one believes but which are not explicit to that conversational context). In order to know such a proposition - even if one’s belief in that proposition is not sensitive - one need only be in a sufficient epistemic position to meet the standards of that context. (The importance of this point will soon become apparent).

DeRose then characterises the mechanism that brings about an upward shift in epistemic standards as follows:

When it is asserted that some subject S knows (or does not know) some proposition P, the standards for knowledge (the standards for how good an epistemic position one must be in to count as knowing) tend to be raised, if need be, to such a level as to require S's belief in that particular P to be sensitive for it to count as knowledge. (DeRose 1995, 36)

That is, what changes a conversational context is when a new proposition is made explicit to that context which is more demanding than any of the propositions currently explicit in that context. This will thus increase the range of possible worlds at issue in the determination of knowledge, and thereby increase the strength of epistemic position required in order to be truly said to know.

What motivates this claim is the fact that, as Lewis (1979) famously argued, when it comes to ‘context-sensitive' terms like ‘flat’ or ‘knowledge’, the conversational ‘score’ tends to change depending upon the assertions of that context. We may all agree that the table in front of us is ‘flat’ in an everyday context, but, ceteris paribus, if someone enters the room and denies that it is flat we do not thereby disagree with her. Instead, we take it that she means ‘flat’ in some more demanding sense and so raise the standards for ‘flatness’ so as to make her assertion true (this is what Lewis (1996, 559) calls a "rule of accommodation"). That is, we take it that the new participant of our conversational context means flat in some more restricted sense so that the barely perceptible bumps on the table before us are sufficient to make the claim "This table is flat" false. DeRose considers the Lewis line to have captured something intuitive about the pragmatics of how we use our ‘context-sensitive’ terms and, moreover, believes that epistemic terms such as ‘knowledge’ behave in a similar way.

An example will help clarify matters here. Imagine an agent in a quotidian context in which only everyday propositions, such as whether or not one is currently having dinner with one's brother (P), or whether or not the garden gate has been closed (Q), are at issue. Sensitivity to these everyday propositions will only require the consideration of nearby possible worlds and thus the strength of epistemic position demanded will be very weak. Let us say, plausibly, that the possible world in which one is not having dinner with one’s brother is ‘further-out’ than the possible world in which the garden gate is not closed. This proposition will thus determine the range of possible worlds at issue in the determination of knowledge in that conversational context. Let us further suppose that the agent in question does have a sensitive belief in this proposition. The issue of what other propositions the subject knows will now be decided by whether the agent’s belief in those propositions will track the truth across the range of possible worlds determined by not-P. If, for instance, the agent’s belief that the garden gate is closed matches the truth as to whether Q in all of the possible worlds within that range, then she will know Q. Equally, however, if the subject’s belief in a proposition which is implicit to that conversational context tracks the truth across this range of possible worlds then that proposition will be known also, even if the agent’s belief in that proposition is not sensitive.

Consider, for instance, the agent's belief that she is not a BIV, a proposition which, as we saw above, one cannot be sensitive to because in the nearest BIV-world one still believes that one is not a BIV. On the contextualist model, however, if one is in a conversational context in which such a proposition is not explicit, then one can know this proposition just so long as one has a belief as to whether this proposition is true which matches the facts as to whether it is true within the range of possible worlds at issue. And, clearly, this demand will be trivially satisfied in the above scenario where the subject has a sensitive belief in the ordinary proposition, P. After all, insofar as one has such a sensitive belief in P, then it must be the case that the BIV skeptical world is, modally speaking, far-out, for if it weren’t, then this would affect the sensitivity of the subject’s beliefs in ordinary propositions like P. Accordingly, on this view, all the subject needs in this context is a stubborn belief that she is not a BIV in order to be truly said to know this proposition in this conversational context. The contextualist can thus capture the second element of the ‘phenomenology’ of our engagement with skepticism that we noted above - that, in quotidian conversational contexts, we are perfectly willing to ascribe knowledge of everyday propositions and also feel that we must know the denials of skeptical hypotheses as well.

One might wonder why I use the word ‘feel' here. Well, the reason is that, on the contextualist account, if one were to explicitly mention these anti-skeptical propositions (as one would if one were to verbally ascribe knowledge of them to oneself), then one would thereby make that proposition explicit to the conversational context and so change the epistemic standards needed for knowledge accordingly. In order to have knowledge that one is not a BIV within the new conversational context, one’s belief that one is not a BIV must now exhibit sensitivity (which, as we saw above, is impossible), and the possible worlds relevant to the determination of that sensitivity will be relevant to one’s knowledge of even everyday propositions. Accordingly, one will now lack knowledge both of the denial of the skeptical hypothesis (because one’s belief in this respect is not sensitive), and of the everyday propositions (since even though one’s beliefs in these propositions are sensitive, one can never be in an epistemic position that would support knowledge of them which would be strong enough to track the truth in far-off BIV-worlds). The contextualist thus claims to have captured the other two aspects of the ‘phenomenology’ of our engagement with skepticism - that we are completely unwilling to ascribe knowledge in skeptical conversational contexts, and that this is even so when the only thing that may have changed from the non-skeptical conversational context in which we were willing to ascribe knowledge is the course of the conversation. Moreover, the contextualist has done this without either conceding the universal truth of skepticism (since skepticism is false in everyday contexts), or denying closure (since there is no single context in which one both knows an everyday proposition whilst lacking knowledge of the denial of a skeptical hypothesis). Accordingly, DeRose claims to have ‘solved’ the skeptical paradox in an entirely intuitive manner.

The semantic contextualist proposals made by Lewis, Cohen and others run along similar lines to the DeRose thesis. The key difference between DeRose and Lewis is that Lewis cashes-out his thesis in terms of a series of rules which determine when we may and may not properly ignore a certain error-possibility rather than in terms of a general modal account of knowledge. The key difference between Cohen's position and that advanced by Lewis and DeRose is that it is centred upon the concept of justification rather than knowledge and incorporates a certain view about the structure of reasons (Cohen 1999; 2000). That the DeRose view differs in these ways from the views presented by Lewis and Cohen may work in its favour. As Timothy Williamson (2001) has pointed out, DeRose’s more straightforward position may be insulated from the kind of ad hoc charges regarding Lewis’ employment of numerous rules governing when an error-possibility is properly ignored, (as put forward, for example, by Williams (2001)). Moreover, the stress on justification in Cohen’s account can make it unappealing to those who find such a notion problematic, at least insofar as it is understood as playing an essential role in knowledge acquisition. There are thus prima facie grounds for thinking that if any semantic contextualist theory will work, then it will be one run along the lines presented by DeRose.

In any case, the most interesting objections against semantic externalism do not rest upon specific elements of the particular versions of this position, but rather strike against the general approach. Perhaps the most obvious concern facing semantic contextualism is that its claim that the epistemic status of an agent's beliefs can be variable in response to mere conversational factors is highly contentious. For instance, contra Cohen’s (1991) contextualist characterisation of his RA position, Dretske writes:

Knowledge is relative, yes, but relative to the extra-evidential circumstances of the knower and those who, like the knower, have the same stake in what is true in the matter in question. Knowledge is context sensitive, according to this view, but it is not indexical. If two people disagree about what is known, they have a genuine disagreement. They can't both be right. (Dretske 1991, 191)

That is, Dretske rejects outright the thought that the truth-value of a knowledge claim can be dependent upon anything other than what the concrete features of the situation are. I won't undertake a detailed discussion of this line of attack against semantic contextualism here, however, since the semantic contextualist proposal is clearly meant to be understood as a revisionistic proposal in this respect. Indeed, this is to be expected given that, as we have already seen, any plausible anti-skeptical proposal will have to deny some claim that is otherwise thought to be intuitive (Dretske himself denies closure, for example). To query this element of the thesis alone is thus not to give it a run for its money (although, if one can couple this line of critique with other concerns then it can carry some dialectical weight).

The other more general lines of criticism against semantic contextualism fall into three main camps. First, there is the allegation that semantic contextualism leaves us no better off than we were before. Second, there is the worry about how the contextualist is to explain our knowledge (albeit only in quotidian contexts) of the denials of skeptical hypotheses. After all, as we noted above, we do have a strong intuition that we can never know such propositions in any context (recall that this intuition was one of the motivating factors behind the Dretskean theory). Third, there is the claim that semantic contextualism is guilty of over-kill in its approach to skepticism in that it essentially incorporates a claim which would suffice to undermine radical skepticism by itself (i. e., regardless of whether it is combined with a general contextualist thesis). Accordingly, on this view, contextualism is both unnecessary and ill-motivated.

The worry that motivates the first concern is that what semantic contextualism does concede to the skeptic is the ‘hierarchical' structure of her doubts. That is, on the semantic contextualist view the skeptic is indeed working at a high epistemic standard, one that is more demanding than our everyday standards. The problem with conceding this much to the skeptic is that it appears to legitimate the concern that the skeptic’s standards are the right standards, and thus that, although we are content to ascribe everyday knowledge in quotidian contexts, we ought not to ascribe such knowledge because, strictly speaking, we lack knowledge relative to the proper skeptical standards that should be employed (see Pritchard 2001a for a development of this problem). This line of thought should be familiar as the general infallibilist line that we saw Unger arguing for in §2 and one might think that one could dismiss it on the same grounds that were canvassed there. Matters are not quite so simple, however. Indeed, it is interesting that in more recent works Unger (1984; 1986) has toned down his commitment to infallibilism in favour of a different conception of the skeptical debate which argues that there is nothing to tell between the contextualist reading of our epistemic concepts and what he calls ‘invariantism’, which would license infallibilist conclusions. Unger’s point here is that all contextualism can achieve is, at best, a kind of impasse with the skeptic such that we know that one of these views must be right but where we are unable to definitively determine which. Is it that the standards are high and only seem variable because we are content to talk loosely in everyday contexts (in which case the infallibilist, and thus the skeptic, is right), or is it that our epistemic concepts are genuinely variable and thus that we do have knowledge relative to low everyday epistemic standards (in which case the contextualist is right and the skeptic is wrong)? The skeptical thought that arises here is that if we are unable to offer sufficient reasons for preferring the latter scenario over the former then contextualism does not put us in a better situation than we were in before.

The second worry - that contextualism is unable to explain how we can have knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses - is particularly striking because if this claim holds then semantic contextualism does not even supply us with an impasse with the skeptic. Instead, the position would simply be incoherent. The thought here is that since our, presumably empirical, knowledge in this respect cannot be coherently thought of as being the result of an empirical investigation, hence we cannot make sense of it at all. Perhaps the bravest response to this line of attack in the recent literature can be found in the suggestion made by both Cohen (1999; 2000) and DeRose (2000) that it might be possible to understand an agent's knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses along a priori lines. Cohen motivates this thought relative to what he terms the "a priori rationality" of denying skeptical error-possibilities (e.g. Cohen 2000, 104), whilst DeRose employs Putnamian reflections on semantic externalism as a means of showing how we might have a priori knowledge of empirical truths.

Even if these lines of argument could be made palatable, however, a further line of attack (the third worry listed above) would instantly emerge. For if we can indeed make sense of our putative knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses then what could the motivation for an epistemologically revisionist thesis like contextualism possibly be? After all, the epistemological revisionism incorporated in contextualism only seemed necessary because our knowledge of these propositions seemed so insecure. If we can have knowledge of these propositions, however, then why not simply motivate one's anti-skepticism by straightforwardly denying the first premise of the skeptical argument, (S1), rather than by going contextualist? We will return to consider this kind of anti-skeptical proposal - known as the ‘Neo-Moorean’ view - in more detail in §5.

4. "Hinge" Propositions and Inferential Contextualism

Before we look at this neo-Moorean approach to radical skepticism, however, it is worthwhile to first consider two lines of argument which, at least superficially, might appear to be analogue approaches to that of the Dretskean and semantic contextualist line. Where these anti-skeptical approaches differ, in the first instance at least, from those just canvassed, is that they primarily take their stimulus not from the RA debate but from Wittgenstein's last notebooks (published as On Certainty) which were on the topic of knowledge and skepticism.

Both of these accounts focus upon the Wittgensteinian notion of a "hinge proposition", though they each use the notion in a different way. The first camp, which includes such figures as Peter Strawson (1985), Crispin Wright (1985; 1991; 2000), Hilary Putnam (1992) and Avrum Stroll (1994) might be considered to be offering the purest hinge proposition thesis because for them the notion is the primary unit upon which their anti-skepticism rests. In contrast, the conception of this notion employed by Williams (1991) is developed along explicitly contextualist lines. Interestingly, however, the type of contextualism that emerges is not of a semantic variety. I will consider each of these views in turn. First, however, we need to look a little at what Wittgenstein had in mind in his employment of this notion.

Wittgenstein describes hinge propositions as follows:

[...] the questions that we raise and our doubts depend upon the fact that some propositions are exempt from doubt, are as it were like hinges on which those turn.

That is to say, it belongs to the logic of our scientific investigations that certain things are in deed not doubted.

But it isn't that the situation is like this: We just can’t investigate everything, and for that reason we are forced to rest content with assumption. If I want the door to turn, the hinges must stay put. (Wittgenstein 1969 §§341-3)

As this quotation indicates, what is odd about these propositions is that, unlike other seemingly empirical propositions, our belief in them does not seem to either stand in need of evidential buttress or, for that matter, be legitimately prone to coherent doubt. And this property is not explained merely by the fact that these propositions are "in deed not doubted", since the situation is rather that we do not doubt them because, in some sense, we ought not to doubt them. Even despite their lack of sufficient evidential support, their immunity to coherent doubt is part of "the logic of our scientific investigations."

In proposing this notion Wittgenstein was explicitly challenging the conventional epistemological wisdom that a belief is only legitimately held if it is sufficiently evidentially grounded (otherwise it is open to legitimate doubt), and that no belief in an empirical proposition is beyond coherent doubt should the grounds for that belief be found wanting. In particular, Wittgenstein's remarks here were primarily targeted at G. E. Moore’s (1925; 1939) famous "common-sense" response to the skeptic. In effect, what Moore did was reverse the skeptical train of reasoning by arguing, on the basis of his conviction that the skeptical conclusion must be false, that he did know the denial of the relevant skeptical hypothesis after all. In general, the Moorean response to the skeptic is to respond to the skeptic’s modus ponens argument with the corresponding modus tollens.

Wittgenstein claimed that where Moore went wrong was in treating a hinge proposition as if it were just a normal empirical proposition. In particular, he focussed upon Moore's use of the everyday proposition ‘I have two hands’ in this respect, arguing that this is, in normal circumstances, a hinge proposition and thus that the certainty that we attach to it is not due to any evidence that we might have for its favour but rather reflects the fact that in those circumstances it is what ‘stands fast’ in our assessment of other propositions. Nothing is more certain that this proposition in ordinary circumstances, and thus no other belief could be coherently regarded as providing support for it or be coherently thought to undermine it. As Wittgenstein puts the matter at one point:

My having two hands is, in normal circumstances, as certain as anything that I could produce in evidence for it.

That is why I am not in a position to take the sight of my hand as evidence for it. (Wittgenstein 1969 §250)

Given that this is so, however, Moore cannot use the certainty he has for this proposition in order to derive support for his belief in the denials of skeptical hypotheses since, strictly speaking, his belief in this proposition is not grounded at all. Indeed, Wittgenstein goes further to argue that, insofar as Moore regards this proposition as being grounded by the evidence he has for it, then the circumstances are no longer ‘normal' in the relevant respects and thus the proposition is no longer a hinge proposition. And in these conditions, it would be ridiculous to try to buttress one’s belief in the denials of skeptical hypotheses with the support that one has for this proposition (Wittgenstein (1969, §20) compares it to basing one’s belief in the existence of the external world on the grounds one has for thinking that there are other planets).

Wittgenstein is not endorsing radical skepticism by attacking Moore in this way, for the general anti-skeptical line that emerges is that where the skeptic, like Moore, goes wrong is in considering certain basic propositions as being coherently open to doubt. In doing so, or so the argument runs, she fails to pay due attention to the pivotal role that certain, apparently ordinary, propositions can play in our systems of beliefs and thus to the manner in which even everyday propositions can be held with conviction without thereby standing in need of a corresponding degree of evidential buttress.

So construed, the hinge proposition line is largely a diagnosis of why we are so tempted by skeptical arguments rather than a refutation of the skeptical argument. Indeed, in the hands of Strawson (1985), Putnam (1992), and Stroll (1994) this is what the hinge proposition line is largely designed to do. So construed, however, it is difficult to see what comfort it offers. After all, it is far from clear that it results in the denial of any of the intuitions that we saw at issue in our formulation of the skeptical argument in §1. In particular, this diagnostic thesis neither results in the denial of closure nor in a contextualist thesis. Moreover, the standard hinge proposition line explicitly allows that hinge propositions are not known, strictly speaking, since they fall outside of the ambit of epistemic evaluation (being instead the nodes around which epistemic evaluation takes place). The anti-skeptical import of the basic hinge proposition line is thus moot.

In the hands of Wright (1985; 1991; 2000) and Williams (1991), however, one finds a much stronger version of this approach. I will focus on each in turn. In effect, Wright argues that doubting hinge propositions does not merely reflect a misunderstanding of the epistemological landscape, rather it also leads to intellectual self-subversion. The most sophisticated of these arguments can be found in Wright (1991), where he attempts to show that dreaming skepticism must be unsound because it leads to a more radical form of doubt which undermines the very presuppositions that the skeptic needs to employ in order to get her dreaming skepticism off the ground. Thus, dreaming skepticism is necessarily intellectually self-subverting and thus it can be disregarded with impunity. What this line adds to the previous approaches is a principled epistemic ground for discounting the skeptic's doubt. In particular, since it is epistemically irrational to doubt the hinge propositions in question, the implication of the argument that Wright offers is that we can indeed know the denials of skeptical hypotheses on the basis of our knowledge of everyday propositions even though our belief in the former is not evidentially grounded. As Wright (1991, 107-8) puts the point, "the impossibility of earning a warrant that one is not now dreaming does not imply that no such warrant is ever possessed."

Although Wright does succeed in at least showing how the diagnosis of radical skepticism that the hinge proposition line offers might lead to a refutation of the skeptical argument, a number of problems with his approach remain. One worry concerns the examples of hinge propositions that he uses. Whereas Wittgenstein seemed to have everyday propositions in mind in his use of this notion (and ‘I have two hands' in particular), Wright’s argument only works if one takes the denials of skeptical hypotheses as hinge propositions, a move that receives only ambiguous support in the text. A more serious worry concerns how, exactly, we are to cash-out this idea that the warrant which underpins our putative knowledge of the denials of hinge propositions can be "unearned" in the fashion that Wright envisages (see Pritchard 2001c). After all, the idea that we could have knowledge of these propositions purely because we have knowledge of everyday propositions does seem to be question begging. Again, then, the worry about closure in the context of the skeptical debate is brought to the fore. The intuition that closure holds leads us to think that an anti-skeptical theory must incorporate the claim that we can know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, even though such knowledge bears few, if any, of the usual hallmarks of empirical knowledge. This tension can only be resolved by either denying closure or allowing that we can know the denials of skeptical hypotheses, but each of these moves raises tensions of its own.

Wright responds to this latter worry in more recent work. Drawing upon remarks made by Martin Davies (1998), Wright (2000) argues that we need to distinguish between the principle of closure and what he terms the principle of "transmission". In essence, his way around this concern about closure is to maintain that whilst knowledge does indeed transfer across known entailments as closure demands, it does not transmit, where transmission requires something more demanding. In particular, transmission demands that the "cogency" of the argument be preserved, which is its aptitude to produce rational conviction. Here is Wright:

A cogent argument is one whereby someone could be moved to rational conviction of the truth of its conclusion. (Wright 2000, 140)

So Wright's thought is that if one does know the everyday propositions then, trivially, one must know the denials of skeptical hypotheses that are known to be entailed by those propositions. Nevertheless, that closure holds in these cases does not mean that any argument that attempts to establish anti-skeptical knowledge on this basis will be apt to convince a third party. After all, notes Wright, the argument is question begging in the relevant respect since it is only by taking for granted the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses (that is, by taking the relevant hinge propositions for granted) that the agent is able to have knowledge of the everyday propositions in the first place. This is a compelling move to make since it diagnoses the arguments against closure by characterising them in terms of how what is lacking from the conclusion is not knowledge but something just as valuable, a conclusion that is apt to convince. It also explains the failure of the Moorean approach, for where Moore goes wrong is not in lacking the knowledge that he claims to have, but rather in attempting to secure any conviction on the part of his audience by offering his argument. Indeed, this is a very Wittgensteinian claim to make since Wittgenstein himself argues that:

Moore's mistake lies in this - countering the assertion that one cannot know that, by saying "I do know it". (Wittgenstein 1969, §521, my italics)

As this quotation implies, the problem with Moore's argument is precisely not the falsity of the conclusion (which would be to validate either radical skepticism or the denial of closure), but rather concerns the manner in which he proposes it and the ends that it is designed to serve.

Still, compelling though this approach is, we are still in need of an account of knowledge which can explain how it is that we can know such propositions as the denials of skeptical hypotheses, something which Wright himself does not offer (see Pritchard 2002a for more on this point). For this contribution to the anti-skeptical debate we must look elsewhere. I will consider such an account in a moment, for one could view the neo-Moorean strategy as presenting the required analysis. First, however, I will briefly mention another influential reading of the hinge proposition thesis, due to Williams (1991).

As might be expected, what identifies Williams' inferential thesis as a contextualist account is that it incorporates the claim that one should understand knowledge relative to a context of some description. Like the semantic contextualist view put forward by DeRose et al, Williams argues that certain error-possibilities are only epistemically relevant, and thus potentially knowledge defeating, in certain contexts. Moreover, Williams is also keen to retain the closure principle. He does so on contextualist grounds, arguing that provided one keeps to the one context then closure will hold. As with the semantic contextualist position, then, apparent failures of closure are simply due to equivocations between different contexts.

The Williams line thus shares a central core of claims with the semantic contextualist view. Nevertheless, their disagreements are significant. The two main areas of disparity between the two theories are as follows. First, Williams does not individuate contexts along a ‘conversational' axis, but rather in terms of the inferential structure of that context (hence the name, inferential contextualism). Second (and as we will see this point is closely related to the inferential thesis), Williams does not allow a context-independent hierarchy of contexts. That is, unlike the semantic contextualists, Williams does not, for example, regard the skeptical context as being a more epistemically demanding context. Rather, it is just a context which employs a different epistemic structure.

Indeed, on Williams' view, contextualism just is the thesis that there is no such hierarchy of epistemic contexts - instead, each context is, epistemically speaking, autonomous. To think otherwise is, he thinks, to fall victim to the doctrine of "epistemological realism" - the view that the objects of epistemological inquiry have an inherent, and thus context-independent, structure. In contrast, the inferential contextualism that he advances is defined as the denial of this thesis. It holds that:

[...] the epistemic status of a given proposition is liable to shift with situational, disciplinary and other contextually variable factors: it is to hold that, independently of such influences, a proposition has no epistemic status whatsoever. (Williams 1991, 119)

And Williams is quite clear that this last phrase "has no epistemic status whatsoever" is meant to indicate that there is no context-independent means by which we can evaluate the standards wrought in different contexts. He describes his view as a "deflationary" theory of knowledge, in that it holds that there need be nothing that ties all instances of knowledge together other than the fact that they are instances of knowledge. He writes:

A deflationary account of "know" may show how the word is embedded in a teachable and useful linguistic practice, without supposing that "being known to be true" denotes a property that groups propositions into a theoretically significant kind. We can have an account of the use and utility of "know" without supposing that there is such a thing as human knowledge. (Williams 1991, 113)

It is as a consequence of such a view that the very validity of the epistemological enterprise, at least as it is commonly understood, is called into question:

If we give up the idea of pervasive, underlying epistemological constraints; if we start to see the plurality of constraints that inform the various special disciplines, never mind ordinary, unsystematic factual discourse, as genuinely irreducible; if we become suspicious of the idea that "our powers and faculties" can be evaluated independently of everything having to do with the world and our place in it: then we lose our grip on the idea of "human knowledge" as an object of theory. (Williams 1991, 106)

And to say that "human knowledge" is not a suitable object of theory is itself to say that the epistemological project cannot be systematically conceived. On Williams' view there is no epistemological analysis to be conducted outside of contextual parameters and, accordingly, there are no context-independent standards either as the semantic contextualist model would suggest.

It is as a consequence of this stance that Williams is forced to concede that the skeptic is perfectly correct in her assessment of our knowledge, but only because she is operating within an epistemic context that utilises a standard which defeats our everyday knowledge. That is, the skeptic's conclusions are correct, but, by being confined to a specific epistemic context, they lack the hegemony that she requires in order to cause the intended epistemic harm. It does not follow from the truth of skepticism that we lack the everyday knowledge that we attribute to ourselves, or even that such knowledge is inferior to the knowledge that the skeptic has in mind (which would, in line with the semantic contextualist view, presuppose a hierarchy). That is:

The skeptic takes himself to have discovered, under the conditions of philosophical reflection, that knowledge of the world is impossible. But in fact, the most he has discovered is that knowledge of the world is impossible under the conditions of philosophical reflection. (Williams 1991, 130)

So whereas the ‘hierarchical' camp of semantic contextualists tend to individuate contexts in terms of a context-transcendent criterion of rigour, Williams’ schema allows no such ordering of contexts. For him, a context is individuated purely in terms of the epistemic structure it endorses - in terms of the inferential relations that obtain between the types of beliefs that that context is interested in. And since no context employs universal standards, this contextual epistemic structure is also identified in terms of what it takes for granted - which propositions it regards as being immune from doubt in terms of that context. Williams calls the defining assumptions of a context of inquiry its "methodological necessities", and this notion is explicitly meant to capture the chief insights behind the Wittgensteinian notion of a hinge proposition. When we do history, for example, we take the general veracity of historical documentation for granted, as well as the denials of certain skeptical scenarios such as that the world came into existence five minutes ago replete with the traces of a distant ancestry (the so-called ‘Russellian Hypothesis’). To doubt such methodological necessities (/hinge propositions) is not, he argues, to conduct our historical investigations in a more exacting fashion, but rather to engage in a different sort of investigation altogether, one that is guided by traditional epistemological concerns.

The methodological necessities of the traditional epistemological project which, Williams claims, spawns the skeptical threat, are meant to involve a commitment to this false doctrine of epistemological realism. This leads, he argues, to an antiquated foundationalism, one manifestation of which is the traditional epistemologist's concern with the problem of the external world. This problem is meant to reflect the inadequacy of beliefs of one type - concerning immediate experience - at serving the purpose of epistemically supporting beliefs of another type - concerning material objects in the external world. With the problem so characterised, Williams maintains that it should come as no surprise to find that it is without a solution (there are no beliefs concerning immediate experience that are able to act as epistemic guarantors for beliefs concerning objects in the material world). But, he contends, this need not result in a general external world skepticism because this conception of the inferential ordering needed for warranted beliefs about ‘external’ objects is far from obligatory. In terms of another type of inquiry, such as psychological investigations of perception for example, we may legitimately begin with beliefs about material objects and draw inferences about immediate experience. And since no context has any epistemological ascendancy over any other, the project of justifying psychological beliefs with reference to external world beliefs is just as valid as any epistemological theory which demanded that the inferential relations should point in the opposite direction.

Williams' inferentialist contextualist view is thus both more radical and more demanding than its semantic counterpart. On the one hand, it is more radical because Williams does not concede to the skeptic that her skepticism functions at a higher epistemic standard. Instead, he argues that such skepticism merely reflects a different, and faulty, conception of the epistemological landscape. Williams’ view therefore evades one strand of criticism that we saw levelled at the semantic contextualist account above. On the other hand, it is more demanding because, for related reasons, Williams does not believe that mere changes in the conversational context can suffice to bring about a different epistemic context. Instead, there must be an actual difference in the inferential structure that is employed, and thus, given his contextualism, a difference in what is being taken for granted relative to what. Nevertheless, inferential contextualism may well carry with it even more troubling problems of its own, not least the worry that this approach is allied to a general quietistic philosophical approach. Critical appraisal of this theory has been limited, however, since this variant of the contextualist thesis has tended to be obscured by its semantic counterpart (though see Putnam 1998). As the dust settles on the current wave of discussion of the semantic contextualist proposal, one would expect this distinctive thesis to gain a greater degree of attention.

5. Neo-Moorean Responses to Skepticism

Back, then, to Wright, or, more specifically, to what was absent in Wright's account, viz., an analysis of knowledge that could account for the conclusions that he presents. In essence, what Wright is offering is a neo-Moorean response to skepticism in that he allows, with Moore, that if we do know everyday propositions then we must know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses that are known to be entailed by them. Where Wright differs from Moore is in not allowing that one can coherently argue to this conclusion in any way that could secure rational conviction. Like Moore, however, Wright fails to supplement this account with an analysis of knowledge that would support it. In so doing, Wright is failing to properly engage with other proponents of the debate regarding radical skepticism - such as Dretske, Nozick and DeRose - who do supplement their anti-skeptical account with an analysis of knowledge (albeit, perhaps, only a partial one) that backs-up their theory. Although Wright does not offer such an account, however, there are analyses of knowledge in the literature that might provide support for his view, and it is to these analyses that we now turn.

Recall that the Dretskean line made Dretskean Sensitivity an essential component of knowledge, where this demanded that an agent should have a belief which is not only true, but which ‘tracks' the truth of the proposition in question in the nearest possible world in which that proposition is false, no matter how ‘far-off’, modally speaking, that world is. It was this element of the thesis that secured the skeptic’s first premise, (S1), because no-one’s belief in the denial of a radical skeptical hypothesis could track the truth in this sense. Similarly, DeRose also made Dretskean Sensitivity relevant to knowledge, albeit only as regards those propositions that were at issue in that context. Accordingly, in skeptical conversational contexts where skeptical hypotheses were at issue agents lacked knowledge of these propositions. What both of these anti-skeptical approaches have in common is thus that they allow that, at least in some contexts, we can lack knowledge of the denials of ‘far-off’ skeptical error-possibilities (and thus that the first premise of the skeptical argument, (S1), is true, at least in some contexts).

In contrast to these lines of thought, Ernest Sosa (1999; 2000) has argued that we should instead regard what he terms "safety" as being central to knowledge rather than sensitivity. In essence, he characterises this notion as follows (Sosa 1999, 142):


In all near-by possible worlds, if an agent believes P, then P is true.

Similar proposals have also been put forward by Mark Sainsbury (1997), Williamson (2000a; 2000b, chapter 8), and Duncan Pritchard (2002c; cf. Pritchard 2001a; 2001b; 2002a). The anti-skeptical advantage that this kind of proposal offers over both the Dretskean line and either of the contextualist views that we have discussed is that it allows one to endorse a version of the Moorean proposal which neither issues in the denial of closure nor results in contextualism.

Take the former point first. What prompted the denial of closure was the fact that, if we take sensitivity as a necessary condition on knowledge, then we must allow that a subject can know everyday propositions whilst being unable to know all the known consequences of those everyday propositions - i.e., the denials of skeptical hypotheses. In contrast, on this view we can allow both that agents have knowledge of everyday propositions and that they can know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses. Suppose, for example, that the agent does have a safe belief in an everyday proposition. Not only is this belief true in the actual world, but, across the range of near-by possible worlds where she believes this proposition, it is true there as well. Insofar as this belief really is safe, however, then there will not be any skeptical possible worlds in the realm of near-by possible worlds which determine that safety (henceforth, the "realm of safety"). For if there were such worlds present in the realm of safety, then this would suffice to undermine the agent's knowledge of the everyday proposition since there would then be a near-by possible world in which the agent still believes the everyday proposition but where this proposition is false (because the skeptical hypothesis is true). But since skeptical possible worlds are now excluded from the realm of safety, it follows that the agent must also have a safe belief that she is not a BIV (or, indeed, the victim of any skeptical hypothesis). The reason for this is that there will be no possible world within the realm of safety in which this proposition is false, and thus, in every world in the realm of safety in which she believes this proposition (which, I take it, is all of them), her belief is true. Accordingly, skepticism is evaded and closure, as least as it functions in skeptical and anti-skeptical reasoning, is retained.

Moreover, the adoption of safety as a necessary condition on knowledge is also able to speak to the core relevant alternatives thought that we saw in §2. As expressed there, the thought was that I should be able to have knowledge without having to consider far-fetched, and therefore irrelevant, error-possibilities. This was supposed to be the intuition that Dretske was trying to accommodate with his modal account of knowledge, but, as we saw, he in fact ended up with a slightly different view which did make far-fetched error-possibilities relevant to knowledge, albeit only knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses (note that it was this element of the view that resulted in the denial of closure). In contrast, a modal interpretation of the RA approach that is much closer to this core intuition is that knowledge (any knowledge) is only dependent upon one's ability to track the truth in the relevant range of near-by possible worlds, not also in worlds far away. Accordingly, if the skeptical possibility is indeed far-fetched then it ought to be unable to influence my knowledge of everyday propositions or, for that matter, my knowledge of the denials of skeptical hypotheses. Safety captures this intuition by allowing agents to have knowledge in both cases provided skeptical possible worlds do not feature in the realm of safety. Dretskean Sensitivity, in contrast, violates this intuition by making knowledge dependent not just on the relevant circumstances in near-by worlds but also on the circumstances that obtain in far-off worlds (such as skeptical worlds) where the target proposition is false.

Furthermore, since the realm of safety does not vary in response to mere conversational factors, it follows that this is not a semantic contextualist thesis. If the agent does indeed know everyday propositions then, in line with the central Moorean contention, she will also know the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses, and this will be so no matter what conversational context the agent is in. We thus have a Moorean variety of anti-skepticism which, whilst keeping to the RA spirit of both the Dretskean and the semantic contextualist proposals, lacks the epistemological revisionism of either.

This is a compelling account of how a neo-Moorean proposal might run, and it certainly does seem to present one very plausible way of reading the core RA thesis. It is not quite as novel as it may at first seem, however, since one can trace the beginnings of such view in Gail C. Stine's critical appraisal of the Dretskean thesis back in 1976. She noted that so long as one sticks to the core RA conception of relevance then the proper conclusion to be extracted is precisely that we shouldn’t concede a lack of knowledge of the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses, and thus reject closure. Instead, the conclusion we should draw is that, since such skeptical error-possibilities are indeed modally far-off, and thus irrelevant, it follows that we do know their denials after all (insofar as we know anything much) and thus that closure remains intact. Stine thus reaches a similar conclusion to Sosa’s, though without employing the technical modal machinery that Sosa adduces. It is interesting to note, however, that Stine recognised problems with this proposal that Sosa does not mention. In particular, she saw that the difficulty facing this brand of RA thesis is to explain how it can be that closure holds and thus that we do know the denials of anti-skeptical hypotheses after all, a problem that we also saw facing the semantic contextualist account above. As Stine herself admits, such a conclusion does indeed "sound odd". In defence of her position she argues that this ‘oddness’ is not due to what is said being false, however (as the Dretske-Nozick line would suggest), but rather concerns the kind of false conversational implicatures that such a claim to know generate.

Although Stine does not develop this move, it is clearly a manœuvre that has a lot of mileage in it since it confronts head-on the worries about the lack of diagnostic appeal of the neo-Moorean approach. After all, one of the advantages of both the Dretskean and the semantic contextualist line is that they can explain the intuitive appeal of radical skepticism without succumbing to it. The neo-Moorean approach, in contrast, seems to make it a mystery as to why we were ever taken in by this fallacious line of reasoning in the first place. Thus, if it could be shown that the skeptic plays on pragmatic features of our language-games with epistemic terms in order to make her arguments superficially plausible, then we could supplement the neo-Moorean theory with a powerful diagnostic account which explains the phenomenology of our engagement with radical skepticism.

Just such an account is offered in Pritchard (2002c; cf. Pritchard 2001b; 2002a). Pritchard claims that we can strengthen Sosa's account of knowledge whilst keeping true to the basic intuition that drives that notion (he offers an account of knowledge based on the notion of "super-safety"). Moreover, he goes on to show that the kind of mechanisms employed by the semantic contextualist account could just as well be regarded as mechanisms which govern the appropriate assertion of knowledge claims rather than as mechanisms which influence the truth-conditions of what is claimed. For example, the thought is that in skeptical conversational contexts it is the standards for correct assertion of knowledge claims that is raised (rather than the standards for knowledge), and that this fact explains why it is that we are reluctant to ascribe knowledge in skeptical contexts even though we are happy to ascribe such knowledge in quotidian contexts. Accordingly, the idea is that semantic contextualism, construed as a thesis about the fluctuating propriety conditions of knowledge claims, could actually be put into the service of the neo-Moorean view to offer the required diagnostic account. Indeed, elsewhere Pritchard (2001b) argues that a similar view can be extracted from some of Wittgenstein’s remarks on "hinge" propositions, so this view may well represent the beginnings of a thesis which integrates the two branches of recent work as regards skepticism. Moreover, Pritchard (2002a) also argues that Wright’s distinction between transmission and closure can be recast in terms of a distinction between the transference of knowledge across known entailments simpliciter (closure), and the transference of knowledge across known entailments where the knowledge retains a certain quality that makes it apt for proper assertion. Wright’s intuition about transmission is thus captured within this development of the neo-Moorean model by making use of the pragmatic features of our employment of epistemic terms.

This neo-Moorean approach is so recent that detailed critical assessment of it has not yet appeared. Nevertheless, we can note one possible avenue of discussion here, which is the possibly contentious use that the diagnostic element of this theory makes of the pragmatic/semantic distinction. If this element of the theory could be called into question then this would suffice to scupper the diagnostic component of the theory and thus drastically reduce its plausibility as an anti-skeptical thesis.

6. Epistemological Externalism and the New Skeptics

Before concluding, it is worthwhile to briefly dwell upon those influential figures in the recent epistemological debate who, in contrast to the current mood of optimism that can be found in epistemological discussion of the problem of radical skepticism, are deeply suspicious that any intellectually satisfactory solution could ever be given to this problem. The roots of this movement in the contemporary literature can be traced back to the work of three main figures - Unger (1971; 1975), Barry Stroud (1984; 1989) and Thomas Nagel (1986). We saw Unger's infallibilist defence of skepticism earlier on, so here I will summarise Stroud’s and Nagel’s contribution, and highlight one way in which this variety of ‘meta-skepticism’ currently informs the skeptical debate, particularly as it figures in more recent work by Stroud (1994; 1996) and Richard Fumerton (1990; 1995).

For both Nagel and Stroud, the thought seems to be that there is something in our philosophical quest for objectivity that inexorably leads us to skeptical conclusions. Nagel argues, for instance, that objectivity involves attaining a completely impartial view of reality, one that is not tainted by any particular perspective. We must, he argues, "get outside of ourselves", and thereby achieve the impossible task of being able to "view the world from nowhere from within it" (Nagel 1986, 76). We realise that the initial appearances present to a viewpoint can be unreliable guides to reality and therefore seek to modify our ‘subjective' view with a more ‘objective’ perspective that is tempered by reason and reflection. As Nagel points out, however, the trouble with this approach is that

[...] if initial appearances are not in themselves reliable guides to reality, [then] why should the products of detached reflection be any different? Why aren't they [...] equally doubtful [...]? [...] The same ideas that make the pursuit of objectivity seem necessary for knowledge make both objectivity and knowledge seem, on reflection, unattainable. (Nagel 1986, 76)

We can reconstruct the argument here as follows. We recognise that our initial unmodified ‘subjective' experience of the world is unreliable and therefore should be adapted along ‘objective’ lines by eliminating the ‘subjective’ element. For instance, initial appearances tell us, falsely, that straight sticks suddenly become ‘bent’ when placed in water. Accordingly, we modify our initial ‘subjective’ view with the testimony of ‘objective’ scientific investigation which tells us that the stick in fact stays straight, it is just the light that is bending. However, and here is the crux of the matter as far as Nagel is concerned, why do we regard this modified view as being any more reliable than the completely ‘subjective’ perspective that it replaces? After all, we cannot eliminate every trace of ‘subjectivity’ and thus the problematic component of our conception of reality that engendered the pursuit of objectivity in the first place remains. Consequently, we are both aware of the need for objectivity whilst also recognising that such objectivity is impossible. As a result, according to Nagel, we are condemned to the following pessimistic evaluation of our epistemic capacities:

The search for objective knowledge, because of its commitment to a realist picture, is inescapably subject to skepticism and cannot refute it but must proceed under its shadow. [...] Skepticism [...] is a problem only because of the realist claims of objectivity. (Nagel 1986, 71)

That is, the problem of skepticism

[...] has no solution, but to recognise that is to come as near as we can to living in the light of truth. (Nagel 1986, 231)

Moreover, since these ‘realist' truths concerning objectivity are meant to be inherent in our epistemic concepts, so it is held that this pessimism falls naturally out of any reflective analysis of our epistemic concepts.

Stroud makes similar claims. He writes:

The sceptical philosopher's conception of our position and of his question for an understanding of it [...] is a quest for an objective or detached understanding and explanation of the position we are objectively in. What is seen to be true from a detached ‘external’ standpoint might not correspond to what we take to be the truth about our position when we consider it ‘internally’, from within the practical contexts which give our words their social point. Philosophical scepticism says the two do not correspond; we never know anything about the world around us, although we say or imply that we do hundreds of times a day.

I think we do have a conception of things being a certain way quite independently of their being known or believed or said to be that way by anyone. I think that the source of the philosophical problem of the external world lies somewhere within just such a conception of an objective world or in our desire, expressed in terms of that conception, to gain a certain kind of understanding of our relation to the world. But in trying to describe that conception I think I have relied on nothing but platitudes we would all accept - not about specific ways we all now believe the world to be, but just the general idea of what an objective world or an objective state of affairs would be. If those platitudes about objectivity do indeed express the conception of the world and our relation to it that the sceptical philosopher relies on, and if I am right in thinking that scepticism can be avoided only if that conception is rejected, it will seem that in order to avoid scepticism we must deny platitudes we all accept. (Stroud 1984, 81-2)

And note that if responding to skepticism involves denying "platitudes that we would all accept", then it follows that any adequate response to the problem of radical skepticism is bound to be intellectually unsatisfactory.

One might wonder, however, exactly how such epistemological pessimism is to impact on the kind of anti-skeptical proposals that we have considered in previous sections. After all, nearly all of them results in the denial of some key claim that the skeptic makes, and does so on motivated grounds. In what sense, then, must we accept that these proposals, whatever the details, are all going to be intellectually unsatisfactory?

In more recent discussion, one begins to see the emergence of a more definitive pessimistic line, however, which may well be able to give a more compelling expression to this worry. In general, although the point is not always put in these terms, the complaint is that these recent anti-skeptical approaches offer us, at best, an epistemologically externalist response to skepticism when what we wanted was one that functioned within an epistemologically internalist framework.

Simplifying somewhat, we can take epistemological internalism to consist in the claim that there is some substantive necessary condition for knowledge which depends upon facts that the agent is in a position to know by reflection alone. That is, the internalist insists that meeting an appropriate ‘internal' epistemic condition is necessary for knowledge possession. Externalists, in contrast, demure from this claim and therefore allow that agents might know merely by meeting ‘external’ epistemic conditions. So, for example, externalists tend to allow that small children or unreflective subjects (such as the now notorious, and possibly non-existent, "chicken-sexer") can have knowledge even though they fail to meet an internal epistemic condition. Internalists, in contrast, set the standards for knowledge higher and thus exclude these agents from possessing knowledge (for more on this distinction, see the essays collected in Kornblith (2001)).

It is notable that all of the main anti-skeptical accounts that we have discussed so far have tended to side with externalism. For both Dretske and Nozick, for example, the sensitivity condition is a condition that merely needs to be met by the agent for that agent to be a potential knower - it is not further demanded that the agent should have the relevant reflective access to the facts which determine that sensitivity. Similar remarks apply to the semantic contextualist account, with both DeRose and Lewis endorsing externalist views (though Cohen might be an exception in this respect). Finally, the neo-Moorean accounts offered by Sosa et al are all described in terms of an externalist epistemology. On closer reflection, it is unsurprising that externalism should be so widely endorsed in this way, though the reasons in each case are different.

The Dretskeans need to be externalists because it is far more problematic to deny closure if knowledge is given an internalist construal. If the denial of closure were not contentious enough, to argue that one could have the kind of ‘reflective' knowledge at issue in the internalist account of both the antecedent and the entailment and yet lack it of the consequent just seems plain absurd.

Since both the neo-Mooreans and the contextualists retain closure, it follows that they need not be troubled by this particular motivation for externalism. The driving force behind their adoption of externalism is, in contrast, the fact that they allow (albeit, in the contextualist case, relative to certain contexts) that an agent can have knowledge of the denials of radical skeptical hypotheses. The problem is that this seems to be precisely the sort of knowledge that cannot be possessed under the internalist rubric because skeptical scenarios are, ex hypothesi, phenomenologically indistinguishable from everyday life. Accordingly, it is plausible to suppose that agents are unable to have the required reflective access to the relevant facts that determine the epistemic status of their beliefs when it comes to these propositions.

Despite the current popularity of externalist accounts of knowledge, however, one might be less sanguine about the prospects for an externalist response to the problem of radical skepticism. After all, the skeptical puzzle seems to be one that strikes against the prima facie attraction of an externalist account of knowledge. As we saw Craig in effect arguing in §2, if we cannot tell the difference between being in the world that we think we are in now and a skeptical possible world such as the BIV-world, then of what comfort is it to be told that, provided we are in the world we think we are, we know a great deal? Instead, it would seem that we want some sort of subjective assurance as regards our knowledge that externalist anti-skeptical accounts are not in a position to provide.

It is this line of thinking that ultimately motivates recent work by Stroud (1994; 1996) and Fumerton (1990; 1995). For example, Fumerton makes the following point:

It is tempting to think that externalist analyses of knowledge [...] simply remove one level of the traditional problems of skepticism. When one reads the well-known externalists one is surely inclined to wonder why they are so sanguine about their supposition that our commonplace beliefs are, for the most part, [...] knowledge. [...] Perception, memory, and induction may be reliable processes (in Goldman's sense) and thus given his metaepistemological position we may [... have knowledge of] the beliefs they produce but, the sceptic can argue, we have no reason to believe that these process are reliable and thus even if we accept reliabilism, we have no reason to think that the beliefs they produce [constitute knowledge]. (Fumerton 1990, 63)

In effect, the complaint that Fumerton is giving expression to here is that externalism allows that there are certain conditions on knowledge that we are unable to reflectively determine have obtained. Indeed, Fumerton is more explicit about the focus of his objection when he goes on to write that

[...] the main problem with externalist accounts, it seems to me, just is the fact that such accounts [...] develop concepts of knowledge that are irrelevant. [...] The philosopher doesn't just want true beliefs, or even reliably produced beliefs, or beliefs caused by the facts that make them true. The philosopher wants to have the relevant features of the world directly before consciousness. (Fumerton 1990, 64)

Presumably, to argue that externalist accounts of knowledge are problematic because they fail to demand that the relevant facts should be "directly before consciousness" is simply to complain that such theories make the satisfaction of non-reflectively accessible external epistemic conditions central to knowledge possession.

Fumerton is not the only one to put forward objections to externalism that run along these lines, though he is perhaps the most explicit about what the complaint that he is giving voice to amounts to. For example, a similar argument against externalism seems to be implicit in the following passages from Stroud:

[...] suppose there are truths about the world and the human condition which link human perceptual states and cognitive mechanisms with further states of knowledge and reasonable belief, and which imply that human beings acquire their beliefs about the physical world through the operation of belief-forming mechanisms which are on the whole reliable in the sense of giving them mostly true beliefs. [...] If there are truths of this kind [...] that fact alone obviously will do us no good as theorists who want to understand human knowledge in this philosophical way. At the very least we must believe some such truths; their merely being true would not be enough to give us any illumination or satisfaction. But our merely happening to believe them would not be enough either. We seek understanding of certain aspects of the human condition, so we seek more than just a set of beliefs about it; we want to know or have good reasons for thinking that what we believe about it is true. (Stroud 1994, 297)

It is difficult to understand Stroud's objection here if it is not to be construed along similar lines to that found in the passages from Fumerton cited above. Stroud’s thought seems to be that it is not enough merely to meet the external epistemic conditions that give us knowledge, rather we should also have the special kind of internal access to those conditions that the internalist demands (and perhaps even more than that).

A new debate is thus emerging in the literature which is to some extent orthogonal to the key discussions that we have considered so far since it questions the very presuppositions of those discussions. Future work on the skeptical puzzle will thus enjoin participants to not only meet the skeptical argument in a motivated fashion, but also respond to this meta-epistemological challenge.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Austin, J. L. (1961). ‘Other Minds', reprinted in his Philosophical Papers, (eds.) J. O. Urmson & G. J. Warnock, 44-84, Clarendon Press, Oxford, England.
  • Cohen, S. (1987). ‘Knowledge, Context, and Social Standards', Synthese 73, 3-26.
  • Cohen, S. (1988). ‘How to be a Fallibilist', Philosophical Perspectives 2, 91-123.
  • Cohen, S. (1991). ‘Skepticism, Relevance, and Relativity', Dretske and his Critics, (ed.) B. McLaughlin, 17-37, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Cohen, S. (1999). ‘Contextualism, Skepticism, and the Structure of Reasons', Philosophical Perspectives 13, 57-90.
  • Cohen, S. (2000). ‘Contextualism and Skepticism', Philosophical Issues 10, 94-107.
  • Craig, E. (1989). ‘Nozick and the Sceptic: The Thumbnail Version', Analysis 49, 161-2.
  • Craig, E. (1990). Knowledge and the State of Nature: An Essay in Conceptual Synthesis, Clarendon Press, Oxford, England.
  • Davies, M. (1998). ‘Externalism, Architecturalism, and Epistemic Warrant', Knowing Our Own Minds: Essays on Self-Knowledge, (eds.) C. J. G. Wright, B. C. Smith & C. Macdonald, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • DeRose, K. (1995). ‘Solving the Skeptical Problem', Philosophical Review 104, 1-52.
  • DeRose, K. (2000). ‘How Can We Know that We're Not Brains in Vats?’, The Southern Journal of Philosophy 38, 121-48.
  • Dretske, F. (1970). ‘Epistemic Operators', Journal of Philosophy 67, 1007-23.
  • Dretske, F. (1971). ‘Conclusive Reasons', Australasian Journal of Philosophy 49, 1-22.
  • Dretske, F. (1981). ‘The Pragmatic Dimension of Knowledge', Philosophical Studies 40, 363-78.
  • Dretske, F. (1991). ‘Knowledge: Sanford and Cohen', Dretske and his Critics, (ed.) B. McLaughlin, 185-96, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Fumerton, R. (1990). ‘Metaepistemology and Skepticism', Doubting: Contemporary Perspectives on Skepticism, (eds.) M. D. Roth & G. Ross, 57-68, Kluwer Academic Publishers, Dordrecht, Holland.
  • Fumerton, R. (1995). Metaepistemology and Skepticism, Rowman & Littlefield, Lanham, Maryland.
  • Klein, P. (1981). Certainty, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis.
  • Klein, P. (1995). ‘Skepticism and Closure: Why the Evil Genius Argument Fails', Philosophical Topics 23, 213-36.
  • Kornblith, H. (2001). Epistemology: Internalism and Externalism, (ed.) Basil Blackwell, Oxford, England.
  • Lewis, D. (1979). ‘Scorekeeping in a Language Game', Journal of Philosophical Logic 8, 339-59.
  • Lewis, D. (1996). ‘Elusive Knowledge', Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74, 549-67.
  • Moore, G. E. (1925). ‘A Defence of Common Sense', Contemporary British Philosophy (2nd series), (ed.) J. H. Muirhead, Allen and Unwin, London, England; reprinted in his Philosophical Papers, Allen & Unwin, London, England (1959).
  • Moore, G. E. (1939). ‘Proof of an External World', Proceedings of the British Academy 25; reprinted in his Philosophical Papers, Allen & Unwin, London, England (1959).
  • Nagel, T. (1986). The View from Nowhere, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Nozick, R. (1981). Philosophical Explanations, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2001a). ‘Contextualism, Scepticism, and the Problem of Epistemic Descent', Dialectica 55, 327-49.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2001b). ‘Radical Scepticism, Epistemological Externalism, and "Hinge" Propositions', Wittgenstein-Studien, 81-105.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2001c). ‘Scepticism and Dreaming', Philosophia 28, 373-90.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2002a). ‘McKinsey Paradoxes, Radical Scepticism, and the Transmission of Knowledge across Known Entailments', Synthese 130, 1-24.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2002b). ‘Radical Scepticism, Epistemological Externalism, and Closure', forthcoming in Theoria 69.
  • Pritchard, D. H. (2002c). ‘Resurrecting the Moorean Response to Scepticism', forthcoming in International Journal of Philosophical Studies 10.
  • Putnam, H. (1992). Renewing Philosophy, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.
  • Putnam, H. (1998). ‘Skepticism', Philosophie in Synthetischer Absicht (Synthesis in Mind), (ed.) M. Stamm, 239-68, Klett-Cotta, Stuttguard, Germany.
  • Sainsbury, R. M. (1997). ‘Easy Possibilities', Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 57, 907-19.
  • Sosa, E. (1999). ‘How to Defeat Opposition to Moore', Philosophical Perspectives 13, 141-54.
  • Sosa, E. (2000). ‘Skepticism and Contextualism', Philosophical Issues 10, 1-18.
  • Stine, G. C. (1976). ‘Skepticism, Relevant Alternatives, and Deductive Closure', Philosophical Studies 29, 249-61.
  • Strawson, P. F. (1985). Skepticism and Naturalism: Some Varieties, Methuen, London.
  • Stroll, A. (1994). Moore and Wittgenstein on Certainty, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Stroud, B. (1984). The Significance of Philosophical Scepticism, Oxford University Press, Oxford, England.
  • Stroud, B. (1989). ‘Understanding Human Knowledge in General', Knowledge and Scepticism, (eds.) M. Clay & K. Lehrer, Westview, Boulder, Colorado.
  • Stroud, B. (1994). ‘Scepticism, ‘Externalism', and the Goal of Epistemology’, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society (supplementary vol.) 68, 290-307.
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Author Information

Duncan Pritchard
University of Stirling
United Kingdom

The Epistemology of Perception

EpisPercPerception is a central issue in epistemology, the theory of knowledge. At root, all our empirical knowledge is grounded in how we see, hear, touch, smell and taste the world around us. In section 1, a distinction is drawn between perception that involves concepts and perception that doesn't, and the various epistemic relations that there are between these two types of perception are discussed--our perceptual beliefs and our perceptual knowledge. Section 2 considers the role of causation in perception and focuses on the question of whether perceptual experience justifies our beliefs or merely causes them. Sections 3 and 4 further investigate the epistemic role of perception and introduce two distinct conceptions of the architecture of our belief system: foundationalism and coherentism. It is shown how perceptual experience and perceptual beliefs are integrated into these systems. Finally, section 5 turns to the externalist view that thinkers need not be aware of what justifies their perceptual beliefs.

Table of Contents

  1. Perception and Belief
    1. Seeing That, Seeing As and Simple Seeing
    2. Perceptual Beliefs
  2. Perception, Justification and Causation
    1. Armstrong's Causal Account of Perceptual Knowledge
  3. Perception and Foundationalism
    1. Traditional Foundationalism
    2. Sellars and the Myth of the Given
    3. Concepts and Experience
    4. Modest Foundationalism
  4. Perception and Coherentism
    1. The Basic Idea Behind Coherentism
    2. Bonjour and the Spontaneous Nature of Perceptual Beliefs
  5. Externalism
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Perception and Belief

a. Seeing That, Seeing As and Simple Seeing

Perception is the process by which we acquire information about the world around us using our five senses. Consider the nature of this information. Looking out of your window, you see that it is raining. Your perception represents the world as being like that. To perceive the world in this way, therefore, it is required that you possess concepts, that is, ways of representing and thinking about the world. In this case, you require the concept RAIN. Thus, seeing that your coffee cup is yellow and that the pencil is green involves the possession of the concepts COFFEE CUP, YELLOW, PENCIL and GREEN. Such perception is termed "perceiving that," and is factive; that is, it is presupposed that you perceive the world correctly. To perceive that it is raining, it must be true that it is raining. You can also, though, perceive the world to be a certain way and yet be mistaken. This we can call, "perceiving as," or in the usual case, "seeing as". A stick partly submerged in water may not be bent but, nevertheless, you see it as bent. Your perception represents the stick as being a certain way, although it turns out that you are wrong. Much of your perception, then, is representational: you take the world to be a certain way, sometimes correctly, when you see that the world is thus and so, and sometimes incorrectly, when the world is not how you perceive it to be.

It also seems that there is a form of perception that does not require the possession of concepts (although this claim has been questioned). It is plausible to claim that cognitively unsophisticated creatures, those that are not seen as engaging in conceptually structured thought, can perceive the world, and that at times we can perceptually engage with the world in a non-conceptual way. You can tell that the wasp senses or perceives your presence because of its irascible behavior. When you are walking along the High Street daydreaming, you see bus stops, waste bins, and your fellow pedestrians. You must see them because you do not bump into them, but you do not see that the bus stop is blue or that a certain pedestrian is wearing Wrangler jeans. You can, of course, come to see the street in this way if you focus on the scene in front of you, but the claim here is that there is a coherent form of perception that does not involve such conceptual structuring. Let us call such baseline perceptual engagement with the world, "simple seeing". This perception involves the acquisition of perceptual information about the world, information that enables us to visually discriminate objects and to successfully engage with them, but also information that does not amount to one having a conceptually structured representation of the world. (Dretske, 1969, refers to simple seeing as "non-epistemic" seeing, and refers to 'seeing that' as "epistemic" seeing).

You can, then, simply see the bus stop, or you can see that the bus stop is blue, or you can, mistakenly, see the bus stop as made of sapphire. These are all forms of perceptual experience, ways you have of causally engaging with the world using your sensory apparatus and ways that have a distinctive conscious or "phenomenological" dimension. Seeing in its various forms strikes your consciousness in a certain way, a way that you are now experiencing as you look at your computer screen. This article investigates the causal and epistemic roles of this perceptual experience.

A little more terminology: the term "sensation" can be used to refer to the conscious aspect of perception, but note that one can have such sensations even when one would not be said to be perceiving the world. When hallucinating, for example, one is having the sensations usually characteristic of perceptual experience, even though in such cases one's experience would not be described as perceptual.

Consider how these various kinds of perceptual experience are related to our perceptual beliefs. Perceptual beliefs are those concerning the perceptible features of our environment, and they are beliefs that are grounded in our perceptual experience of the world. The content of such beliefs can be acquired in other ways: You could be told that the bus stop is blue, or you could remember that it is blue. Right now, though, waiting for the bus, you acquire this belief by looking straight at it, and, thus, you have a perceptual belief concerning this particular fact. Just how your perceptual beliefs are grounded in your perceptual experience is a contentious issue. There is certainly a causal relation between the two, but some philosophers also claim that it is perceptual experience that provides justification for our perceptual beliefs. This foundationalist claim is denied by the coherentist (see sections 3 and 4 below).

b. Perceptual Beliefs

First, one does not necessarily come to acquire perceptual beliefs in virtue of simply seeing the world. Simple seeing is something that cognitively unsophisticated creatures can do, creatures such as wasps that do not have more sophisticated beliefs, propositional beliefs. It is plausible, though, that if one sees a certain object as a bus stop, then one would also come to believe that there is a bus stop being seen. In many cases, this is, of course, true, but it is not in all. A famous example is the Muller-Lyer illusion:


The two horizontal lines above look as though they are of different lengths, the upper line being longer than the lower. If we have seen the illusion before, then we do not believe our eyes. Instead, we believe that the lines are the same length (which they are). Here is another case: a habitual user of hallucinogenics may doubt the veracity of all his perceptions; he may not believe anything he sees. His perception, however, amounts to more than simply seeing; he sees the moon as being made of cheese and his cup of tea as grinning up at him. Yet, because of the doubt fostered by his frequent hallucinations, he does not move from seeing the world as being a certain way to believing that it is. In most cases, though, if one sees the world as being a certain way, then one also believes that it is that way. Last, let us return to the notion of "perceiving that." Such perception has a closer relationship with the acquisition of perceptual belief. If one is described as perceiving that the world is a certain way, it is implied that one also believes that the world is so. Here, there isn't room for perception to come apart from belief.

Thus, we have seen that we can be perceptually engaged with the world in various ways. Such engagement can amount to the mere acquisition of perceptual information, the experience of seeing the world as being a certain way, or the possession of the cognitive states of perceiving and believing that it is so. If all goes well, such perceptual beliefs may constitute perceptual knowledge of the world. According to the traditional account, this is when those beliefs are true and when they are justified. Perceptual knowledge consists in knowledge of the perceptible features of the world around us, and it is that which is grounded in our perceptual experience. Again, the nature of this grounding is controversial. Perceptual experience is certainly causally related to perceptual knowledge; foundationalists, however, make the further claim that such experience provides the justification that is constitutive of such knowledge (see section 3). Others, though, including Armstrong (section 2a) and the coherentists (section 4), do not believe perceptual experience plays this justificatory role with respect to perceptual knowledge. The next section considers this key issue of justification.

But consider the issue of skepticism. The skeptical arguments of Descartes (1641) have had an enormous influence on both the history and practice of epistemology. He suggests certain scenarios that threaten to undermine all of our empirical knowledge of the world. It could be that right now you are dreaming. If you were, everything might appear to you just as it currently does; dreams are sometimes very real. It is also possible that a powerful demon might be deliberately deceiving you; there may not be an external world at all, and all your perceptual experience and perceptual beliefs may be simply planted in your mind by this evil entity. Given such scenarios, it is not clear how our perceptual beliefs can be justified and thus, how we can have perceptual knowledge. Any reasons you have for thinking that such beliefs correctly represent the world are undermined by the fact that you could have such beliefs even if the external world did not exist. Since the seventeenth century, epistemology has been trying to find a solution to this Cartesian scepticism. This article simply assumes that we can have justification for our perceptual beliefs and that perceptual knowledge is possible. Given this assumption, the focus is on how we should conceive of such justification.

2. Perception, Justification and Causation

Perceptual experience provides both causal and justificatory grounding for our perceptual beliefs and for our knowledge of the passing show. In this section, we shall start to look at the causal and justificatory relations between perception, belief and knowledge. As was discussed above, our perceptual experience can be conceptually structured: we can see the world as being a certain way, or we can see that it is thus and so. Thus, such experience could be seen as providing justification for our perceptual knowledge in that you could be justified in taking things to have the properties you see them as having. The fact that perceptual experience is conceptual, however, is not sufficient to ensure that your perceptual beliefs are justified. Dave, a friend of yours, sees every tackle made against a player of West Ham United Football Club as a foul. He is not, however, justified in taking this to be true. Often these clashes are simply not fouls; Dave is wrong, and even when he is correct, when he really sees that a foul has been committed, it would seem that his prejudiced observation of the game entails that in these cases he only gets it right through luck, and thus, he is not justified in his belief. The fact, then, that our experience is conceptual does not entail that we have justified perceptual beliefs or knowledge. Section 3 considers what else needs to be said, and investigates an account of how perceptual experience is seen to provide epistemic justification. First, though, consider an account of perceptual knowledge that does not make use of the notion of justification.

a. Armstrong's Causal Account of Perceptual Knowledge

Armstrong (1961 / 1973) claims that perceptual knowledge simply requires that one's perceptual beliefs stand in lawlike relations to the world.

What makes...a belief a case of knowledge? My suggestion is that there must be a lawlike connection between the state of affairs Bap [that a believes p] and the state of affairs that makes 'p' true such that, given Bap, it must be the case that p. (Armstrong, 1973, p. 75)

Crudely, since causal relations are lawlike, if our perceptual and cognitive apparatus is such that it is buzzing flies that cause us to have perceptual beliefs about buzzing flies, then it will be the case that we will have perceptual knowledge of this annoying aspect of our environment when the bees cause the belief. Armstrong calls his account a "thermometer model" of knowledge. We can come to have knowledge of the world just as a thermometer can come to represent its own temperature. In both systems, there is simply a lawlike relation between a property of the world and a property of a representative device (the level of mercury in a thermometer or the state of certain internal cognitive mechanisms of a thinker).

Highlighting the role of perceptual experience, Armstrong claims that:

"perception is nothing but the acquiring of knowledge of, or, on occasions, the acquiring of an inclination to believe in, particular facts about the physical world, by means of our senses," (Armstrong, 1961, p. 105)

He does, however, claim that there is a "contingent connection between perception and certain sorts of sensation," and that this, "may help to explain the special 'feel' of perception," (Armstrong, 1961, p. 112). Conscious sensation, then, is not essential to perception. I could be correctly said to see the road ahead as I drive late at night on the motorway, even though I have "switched off," and appear to be driving on "autopilot." I can see the road because I am still causally acquiring beliefs about the world in front of me by way of my senses. Similarly, cases of blindsight are also bonafide cases of perception. Blindsight patients claim to have a complete lack of visual experience on, for example, their left side, yet they can make reliable reports about shapes and objects that are presented to this side of their perceptual field (they themselves, however, claim that they are merely guessing). They do, then, seem to be acquiring correct beliefs about their environment via a causal engagement between the world and their senses, and thus, they perceive the world even though in such cases the contingent connections with sensation are lost. Thus, on Armstrong's account, perceptual experience is not necessary for perceptual knowledge. When one does have conscious perceptual experiences, these do not play a justificatory role; they are simply causally related to perceptual belief and knowledge. Many, however, find such an account too sparse, in that one's experience does not play any justificatory or epistemic role in the acquisition of perceptual beliefs or knowledge. It is claimed that a more satisfying theory of perception should include an account of why perceptual experience justifies our perceptual beliefs and that we should not be content with simply an account of why we are caused to acquire them. The following theory of perception attempts to include just such an account of justification.

3. Perception and Foundationalism

Foundationalists claim that the superstructure of our belief system inherits its justification from a certain subset of perceptual beliefs upon which the rest sits. These beliefs are termed "basic beliefs." Our belief system, then, is seen as having the architecture of a building. Later, in section 4, we shall see that coherentists take our belief system to be more akin to an ecosystem, with our beliefs mutually supporting each other, rather than relying for their justification on certain crucial foundation stones. There are various versions of this foundationalist approach, two of which are discussed in the next two sections.

a. Traditional Foundationalism

Traditionally the foundations of knowledge have been seen as infallible (they cannot be wrong), incorrigible (they cannot be refuted), and indubitable (they cannot be doubted). For empiricists, these foundations consist in your beliefs about your own experience. Your beliefs are basic and non-basic. Your basic beliefs comprise such beliefs as that you are now seeing a red shape in your visual field, let us say, and that you are aware of a pungent smell. In order to justify your non-basic belief that Thierry Henry is the best striker in Europe, you must be able to infer it from other beliefs, say that he has scored the most goals. The traditional foundationalist claim, however, is that this sort of inferential justification is not required for your basic beliefs. There may not actually be a red object in the world because you may be hallucinating, but, nevertheless, you cannot be wrong about the fact that you now believe that you am seeing something red. Justification for such beliefs is provided by experiential states that are not themselves beliefs, that is, by your immediate apprehension of the content of your sensory, perceptual experience, or what is sometimes termed, "the Given". It is, then, your experience of seeing red that justifies your belief that you are seeing red. Such experience is non-conceptual. It is, though, the raw material which you then go on to have conceptual thoughts about. This conception of the relation between knowledge and experience has had a distinguished history. It was advocated by the British empiricists--Locke, Berkeley and Hume--and by the important modern adherents C. I. Lewis (1946) and R. Chisholm (1989). However, this conception of how your perceptual beliefs are justified has been widely attacked, and the next two sections address the most influential arguments against traditional foundationalism.

b. Sellars and the Myth of the Given

Sellars (1956) provides an extended critique of the notion of the Given. There are two parts to Sellars' argument: first, he claims that knowledge is part of the "logical space of reasons;" and second, he provides an alternative account of "looks talk," or an alternative reading of such claims as "that looks red to me," claims that traditionally have been seen as infallible and as foundations for our perceptual knowledge. According to Sellars, no cognitive states are non-inferentially justified. For him:

"The essential part is that in characterising an episode or a state as that of knowing, we are placing it in the logical space of reasons, of justifying and being able to justify what one says." (Sellars, 1956, p. 76)

Whether we are talking about perceptual or non-perceptual knowledge, we must be able to offer reasons for why we take such claims to be true. To even claim appropriately that I have knowledge that I now seem to be seeing a red shape, I must be able to articulate such reasons as, "since my eyes are working fine, and the light is good, I am right in thinking that I am having a certain sensory experience." As Rorty (1979, chapter 4) argues, justification is essentially a linguistic or "conversational" notion; it must consist in the reasoned recognition of why a particular belief is likely to be true or why one is rightly said to be having a certain experience. If such an account of justification is correct, then the notion of non-inferentially justified basic beliefs is untenable and non-conceptual perceptual experience cannot provide the justification for our perceptual beliefs.

Surely, though, "this looks red to me," cannot be something that I can be wrong about. Such a foundationalist claim seems to be undeniable. Sellars, however, suggests that such wording does not indicate infallibility. One does not say, "This looks red to me," to (infallibly) report the nature of one's experience; rather, one uses such a locution in order to flag that one is unsure whether one has correctly perceived the world.

... when I say "X looks green to me"...the fact that I make this report rather than the simple report "X is green," indicates that certain considerations have operated to raise, so to speak in a higher court, the question 'to endorse or not to endorse.' I may have reason to think that X may not after all be green. (Sellars, 1956, p. 41)

Thus, Sellars provides a two-pronged attack on traditional foundationalism. The way we describe our perceptual experience does indeed suggest that we have infallible access to certain private experiences, private experiences that we cannot be mistaken about. However, we should recognize the possibility that we may be being fooled by grammar here. Sellars gives an alternative interpretation of such statements as, "this looks red to me," an interpretation that does not commit one to having such a privileged epistemological access to one's perceptual experience. Further, a conceptual analysis of "knowledge" reveals that knowledge is essentially a rational state and, therefore, that one cannot claim to know what one has no reason for accepting as true. Such reasons must be conceived in terms of linguistic constructions that one can articulate, and thus, the bare presence of the Given cannot ground the knowledge we have of our own experience or, consequently, of the world. This, then, is a rejection of the traditional foundationalist picture, or what Sellars calls, "the Myth of the Given."

One of the forms taken by the Myth of the Given is the idea that there is, indeed must be, a structure of particular matter of such fact that (a) each fact can not only be noninferentially known to be the case, but presupposes no other knowledge either of particular matters of fact, or of general truths; and (b) such that the noninferential knowledge of facts belonging to this structure constitutes the ultimate court of appeal for all factual claims, particular and general, about the world. (Sellars, 1956, pp. 68-9)

c. Concepts and Experience

According to traditional foundationalism, the content of perceptual experience, the Given, is not conceptual in nature. It has been argued, however, that experience should not be seen in this traditional way. The phenomenon of "seeing as," suggests to some that experience should be interpreted as essentially conceptual in nature.

What is this a picture of?


You perhaps see a duck. I can, however, alter the character of your visual experience by changing the beliefs that you have about this picture. Think RABBIT looking upward. The picture now looks different to you even though you are seeing the same configuration of black marks on a white background. This picture is usually referred to as "the duck-rabbit." Originally, you saw the drawing as a duck; now you see it as a rabbit (or, as Wittgenstein would say, you notice different "aspects" of the picture). You have, then, distinct perceptual experiences dependent on the particular concepts "through which" you see that picture. Some take this to prove that perceptual experience is not pre- or non-conceptual but that it is essentially a conceptual engagement with the world. Such experience does not only consist in our having certain retinal images: "There is more to seeing than meets the eyeball," (Hanson, 1988, p. 294). It is, rather, the result of a necessary conceptual ordering of our perceptual engagement with the world. This is a theory of experience that is at odds with that of the traditional foundationalist.

The theory has Kantian roots. For Kant, one cannot experience the world without having a conceptual structure to provide the representational properties of such experience. In Kant's terms, the intuitions received by the sensibility cannot be isolated from the conceptualization carried out by the understanding. As he states, "Intuitions without concepts are blind, concepts without intuitions are empty" (Kant, 1781, A51 / B75). Intuitions, or what we might call bare perceptual experience--that which does not have a conceptual structure--cannot be seen as experience of a world, and therefore, such a conception of our perceptual engagement with the world cannot be seen as experiential at all; it is "blind". The second clause of Kant's aphorism claims that concepts that are not based on information received through the senses can have no empirical content. The Kantian claim, then, is that thinking about the world and experiencing it are interdependent. This is an attack on the distinction drawn in section 1a between simple seeing and conceptually structured forms of perception such as seeing that and seeing as. Kant claims the notion of simple seeing is incoherent since such a non-conceptual engagement with the world isn't experiential.

Not everyone accepts that the phenomenon of seeing as entails this picture of experience. Dretske (1969) argues that simple or non-epistemic seeing is independent of epistemic seeing; that is, it is independent of seeing that is conceptually structured. Non-epistemic seeing amounts to the ability to visually differentiate aspects of one's environment such as the bus stop and the waste bin, and one can do this without seeing these items as anything in particular (although, of course, one usually does). Further, "seeing as" presupposes simple seeing. One has to have some bare experience to provide the raw materials for our conceptually structured experience or thought. We may be able to see the picture above as a duck or as a rabbit, but we can only do this if we have a non-conceptual experience of a certain configuration of black marks on a white background. One's experience of the basic black and white lines in the figure is independent of any concepts one may have that may then allow one to see these lines in a certain more sophisticated way, that is, as a duck or as a rabbit. In reply, however, it could be claimed that even such a basic experience as this relies on the contingent fact that one has the concepts of, for example, BLACK and WHITE. Perhaps if one did not have these concepts, then one could not even see this basic figure.

We have, then, looked at two problems faced by the traditional foundationalist, both of which center on the alleged non-conceptual nature of perceptual experience. Two responses have been made by those who feel the force of these objections: some modify foundationalism in order to take account of some of the considerations above, and others reject it altogether. The first of these responses is the topic of the next section.

d. Modest Foundationalism

Some foundationalists agree that the Given is in some ways problematic, yet they still attempt to maintain a "modest" or "moderate" foundationalism. Audi (2003) and Plantinga (2000) promote this view. First, our perceptual beliefs concerning both the world and our own experience are not seen as infallible. You can believe that you see red or that you seem to see red, yet either belief could turn out to be unjustified. Second, non-conceptual perceptual experience does not play a justificatory role. Perceptual beliefs are simply self-justified; that is, it is reasonable to accept that they are true unless we have evidence to suggest that they may be untrustworthy. Such a view of perception remains foundationalist in nature because we still have basic beliefs, beliefs that are non-inferentially justified. Thus, the justification possessed by perceptual beliefs is defeasible. You may, for example, have good evidence that your cup of tea has been spiked with an hallucinogen, and, therefore, the justification for your perceptual belief that a pig has just flown past the window is defeated. More controversially, your belief that you seem to see red could be defeated by psychological evidence concerning your confused or inattentive state of mind. However, in the absence of any beliefs concerning such contravening evidence, your perceptual beliefs have prima facie justification.

Modest foundationalism avoids a dilemma that faces traditional foundationalism. It is certainly plausible that beliefs about your own perceptual experience are infallible and that you can't be wrong when you claim that the cup looks red. It is not clear, however, how such beliefs can ground your perceptual knowledge since they are about your own mental states and not the world. The fact that the cup looks red to you does of course relate to the cup, but primarily it is a fact about how that cup strikes your experience. Recoiling from such a picture, you could claim that your foundational beliefs concern the color of the cup and not merely your experience of the cup. However, it is not plausible that your beliefs about the color of the cup are infallible, and therefore, such beliefs cannot play a foundational role according to the traditional account. The modest foundationalist can avoid this dilemma. For a perceptual belief to be justified, it does not have to be infallible. You can, therefore, have beliefs about the properties of objects in the world playing the requisite foundational role rather than those that are simply about your own experiences.

4. Perception and Coherentism

Modest foundationalists attempt to keep some of the features of the traditional foundationalist picture while conceding that their foundations aren't infallible. There is, however, a distinct response to the problems associated with traditional foundationalism, and that is to reject its key feature, namely its reliance on foundational, non-inferential, basic beliefs. Coherentism presents an alternative. Coherentists such as Bonjour (1985) and Lehrer (1990) claim that beliefs can only be justified by other beliefs and that this is also true of our perceptual beliefs. Section 3.a described how Sellars argued for such a position in that, for him, perceptual beliefs must be supported by beliefs about the reliability of our experience. The next two sections explain the coherentist account of justifying perceptual claims.

a. The Basic Idea Behind Coherentism

For a coherentist, a particular belief is justified if one's set of beliefs is more coherent with this belief as a member, and, conversely, a belief is unjustified if the coherence of one's set of beliefs is increased by dropping that particular belief. The basic idea behind coherentism is that the better a belief system "hangs together," the more coherent it is. How, though, should we conceive of "hanging together" or "coherence"? First, one requires consistency. Our beliefs should not clash; they must not be logically inconsistent: we should not believe p and believe that not p. However, more than mere logical consistency is required. One could imagine a set of beliefs that consisted of the belief that 2+2=4, the belief that Cher is a great actress, and the belief that yellow clashes with pink. Although these beliefs are logically consistent, they do not form a particularly coherent belief set since they do not have any bearing on each other at all. For coherence, therefore, some kind of positive connection between one's beliefs is also required. Such a positive connection is that of inference. A maximally coherent belief set is one that is logically consistent and one within which the content of any particular belief can be inferred from the content of certain other beliefs that one holds. Conversely, the coherence of a set of beliefs is reduced if there are subgroups of beliefs that are inferentially isolated from the whole.

b. Bonjour and the Spontaneous Nature of Perceptual Beliefs

For a coherentist, perceptual beliefs are justified, as all beliefs are, if our acceptance of them leads to an increase in the overall coherence of our belief system. An account, though, is also required of how perceptual beliefs can be seen as correctly representing the external world, a world that is independent of our thinking. This is particularly pressing for the coherentist because the justification for our perceptual beliefs is provided by one's other beliefs and not by one's perceptual experience of one's environment.

To account for the representational ability of perceptual beliefs, Bonjour focuses upon a class of beliefs that he calls "cognitively spontaneous." These are beliefs we simply acquire without inference. Right now, on turning my head to the left, I spontaneously acquire the belief that the orange stapler is in front of the blue pen, and that my glass of water is half full. These perceptual beliefs are likely to be true when certain conditions obtain--that the light is good and that I am not too far away from what I am looking at (these Bonjour calls the "C-conditions"). My belief, then, that my glass is half full is only justified if I also have beliefs about the obtaining of C-conditions. However, for Bonjour's account to be persuasive, he needs to provide some justification for this claim that beliefs acquired in the C-conditions are likely to be true representations of the world. This he does. First, we do not arrive at them via inference; they are spontaneous. Second, the beliefs that we acquire in this way exhibit a very high measure of coherence and consistency with each other and with the rest of our belief system. The question arises, then, as to why this should be so, since it is not obvious why such spontaneous beliefs should continue to cohere so well. If, for example, these beliefs were randomly produced by our perceptual mechanisms, then our set of beliefs would very soon be disrupted. Bonjour's claim is that there is a good a priori explanation for the ongoing coherence and consistency of our set of beliefs, that is, that it is the result of our beliefs being caused by a coherent and consistent world. Thus, our perceptual beliefs correctly represent a world that is independent of our thinking. Non-conceptual perceptual experience does not play a justificatory role with respect to perception. This experience may cause us to acquire certain beliefs about our environment, but the justification for these perceptual beliefs is provided by the inferential relations that hold between these beliefs and the rest of our belief system.

There are important objections. Plantinga (1993) notes that in the Cartesian skeptical scenarios we also have a coherent set of beliefs, but in these cases they are caused not by a coherent and consistent world but by an evil demon or by a mad scientist who manipulates a brain that lies in a vat of nutrient fluid (see Descartes 1641 and Putnam 1981). Bonjour's claim, however, is that it is a priori more probable that our beliefs are not caused by these creatures. Plantinga finds such reasoning "monumentally dubious."

Even if such a hypothesis [that concerning the claim that our coherent belief system corresponds to a coherent world] and these skeptical explanations do have an a priori's surely anyone's guess what that probability might be. Assuming there is such a thing as a priori probability, what would be the a priori probability of our having been created by a good God who...would not deceive us? What would be the a priori probability of our having been created by an evil demon who delights in deception? And which, if either, would have the greater a priori probability? could we possibly tell? (Plantinga, 1993, p. 109)

5. Externalism

The varieties of foundationalism and coherentism examined so far share a certain approach to questions concerning epistemic justification. They ask whether the evidence available to you is sufficient to justify the beliefs that you hold. Questions of justification are approached from the first person perspective. Foundationalists claim that you have justified perceptual beliefs because of the fact that these beliefs are grounded in your perceptual experience, experience that is, of course, accessible to you; it is something of which you are aware, something that you can reflect upon. Coherentists find justification in the inferential relations that hold between your perceptual and non-perceptual beliefs, relations that are, again, something to which you have cognitive access. Epistemic practices can, however, also be assessed from the third person perspective. It can be asked whether a person's methods do, in fact, lead him or her to have true beliefs about the world, whether or not such reliability is something of which they are aware. Externalists claim that it is this perspective with which epistemology should be concerned. A key notion for externalists is that of reliability. A belief is justified if it is acquired using a method that is reliable, with reliability being cashed out in terms of the probability that one's thinking latches onto the truth.

The justificatory status of a belief is a function of the reliability of the processes that cause it, where (as a first approximation) reliability consists in the tendency of a process to produce beliefs that are true rather than false. (Goldman, 1979, p. 10)

One need not be able to tell by reflection alone whether or not one's thinking is reliable in the required sense; a thinker does not have to be aware of what it is that justifies his or her beliefs.

According to a reliabilist, then, a perceptual belief is justified if it is the product of reliable perceptual processes. One strategy that reliabilists have adopted is to ground their account of reliability in terms of the causal connections that thinkers have to the world. Roughly, for one to have a justified perceptual belief that p, the fact that p should cause my belief that p. I am justified in believing that Frasier is on television because its presence on the screen causes my belief. Such accounts are developed by Goldman (1979 / 1986) and Dretske (1981). It is important to note the difference between this kind of account and that of Armstrong (section 2a). Armstrong eschews all talk of justification and provides a wholly causal account of perceptual knowledge. Many externalists, however, give an account of justification in causal terms.

It was assumed throughout this article, except during the discussion of scepticism, that we do have perceptual knowledge of the world, and the article explored the multifarious epistemic and causal relations that there are between the various modes of perception and perceptual knowledge. Justification is the key issue, and there are four basic stances. One stance is to agree with Armstrong and deny that perceptual experience plays any justificatory role. Foundationalists see perceptual experience as the justificatory basis for perceptual knowledge, and it is such experience that ultimately provides justification for all our knowledge of the world. Problems with the traditional form of this position urged us to explore a more modest form of foundationalism. Others reject foundationalism altogether. Coherentists claim that the justification for our perceptual beliefs is a function of how well those beliefs "hang together" with the rest of our belief system. They too reject the justificatory role of perceptual experience. Some externalists claim that justification is a matter of reliability and that so long as our perceptual beliefs are produced by mechanisms that reliably give us true beliefs, then those beliefs are justified. Therefore, perception is of prime epistemological importance, and it remains the focus of lively philosophical debate.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D. M. 'The Thermometer Theory of Knowledge' in S. Bernecker & F. Dretske, eds. Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology, Oxford University Press, Oxford, pp. 72-85, 2000. Originally published in Armstrong, 1973, pp. 162-75, 178-83.
  • Armstrong, D. M. Belief, Truth and Knowledge, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1973.
  • Armstrong, D. M. Perception and the Physical World, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London, 1961.
    • Included in the above is Armstrong's causal account of perception.
  • Audi, R. "Contemporary Modest Foundationalism," in Pojman, L. ed. The Theory of Knowledge: Classical and Contemporary Readings, Wadsworth, Belmont, CA. 3rd edition, 2003.
    • A useful paper in which it is argued that modest foundationalism has advantages over traditional foundationalism.
  • Bonjour, L. The Structure of Empirical Knowledge, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass. 1985.
    • A well-developed coherentist theory of justification which includes an account of the role of perception within such a theory. (One should note, however, that Bonjour has recently abandoned coherentism in favour of a version of foundationalism.)
  • Chisholm, R. M. Theory of Knowledge, 3rd edition, Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey, 1989.
    • A wide ranging study of various epistemological issues including his version of traditional foundationalism.
  • Descartes, R. "First Meditation," in Meditations on First Philosophy, 1641. Reprinted in The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, eds. J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff & D. Murdoch, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1983.
    • One of the most influential passages of epistemological writing in the history of Western philosophy in which various skeptical possibilities are raised that suggest that our perceptual beliefs may not be justified.
  • Dretske, F. Seeing and Knowing, Routledge and Kegan Paul, London, 1969.
    • Dretske defends the claim that seeing can be seen as non-conceptual (or non-epistemic).
  • Dretske, F. Knowledge and the Flow of Information, MIT Press, Cambridge, Mass. 1981.
    • Here he presents his sophisticated version of reliabilism.
  • Goldman, A. I. "What is Justified Belief?," in G. Pappas, ed. Justification and Knowledge: New Studies in Epistemology, Reidel, pp. 1-23, 1979.
  • Goldman, A.I. Epistemology and Cognition, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass. 1986.
    • In the above, Goldman forwards his reliabilist account of justification.
  • Grice, H. P. "The Causal Theory of Perception," in Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 35, pp. 121-52, 1961.
    • A precursor to the various contemporary causal theories of perception, presented in the context of a sense datum theory of perception.
  • Hanson, N. R. "From Patterns of Discovery," in Perception, R. Schwartz, ed. pp. 292- 305, 1988.
    • Hansen argues that the nature of our perceptual experience depends on the concepts we possess.
  • Kant, I. The Critique of Pure Reason, trans. N. Kemp Smith, 1929 edition, The Macmillan Press, Ltd. Basingstoke, Hampshire, 1781.
    • One of the greatest and most influential works of modern philosophy. Of relevance to this article are Kant's thoughts concerning the relation between our conceptual framework and the nature of our perceptual experience.
  • Lehrer, K. Theory of Knowledge, Westview Press, Boulder, Colorado, 1990.
    • Lehrer provides a critique of foundationalism and his own developed version of coherentism.
  • Lewis, C. I. An Analysis of Knowledge and Evaluation, La Salle, Illinois, 1946.
    • Amongst various other important epistemological issues, one can find Lewis's account of traditional foundationalism.
  • McDowell, J. Mind and World, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass. 1994.
    • In this transcription of his Locke lectures, McDowell argues that perceptual experience is essentially conceptual in nature.
  • Plantinga, A. Warrant: The Current Debate, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 1993.
    • An excellent epistemology textbook which includes an in-depth critique of Bonjour's coherentism.
  • Plantinga, A. Warranted Christian Belief, Oxford University Press, Oxford, 2000.
    • In the context of a sophisticated discussion of the philosophy of religion, Plantinga develops a version of modest foundationalism which he calls "reformed epistemology".
  • Putnam, H. Reason, Truth and History, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge, 1981.
    • In chapter 1, Putnam presents his contemporary brain in a vat version of the Cartesian skeptical scenario.
  • Rorty, R. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, Princetown University Press, Princetown, 1979.
    • A historically informed and extended attack on traditional foundationalism.
  • Schwartz, R. Perception, Blackwell, Oxford, 1988.
    • A good collection of articles focused on the epistemology of perception.
  • Sellars, W. Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind. Originally published in H. Feigl and M. Scrivens, eds. Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, vol. 1, University of Minnesota Press, Minneapolis, pp. 253-329, 1956. Page numbers here refer to 1997 reprint, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Mass.
    • This includes Sellars' influential attack on the Given.

Author Information

Daniel O'Brien
The University of Birmingham
U. S. A.

Religious Epistemology

Belief in God, or some form of transcendent Real, has been assumed in virtually every culture throughout human history. The issue of the reasonableness or rationality of belief in God or particular beliefs about God typically arises when a religion is confronted with religious competitors or the rise of atheism or agnosticism. In the West, belief in God was assumed in the dominant Jewish, Christian and Islamic religions. God, in this tradition, is the omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good and all-loving Creator of the universe (such a doctrine is sometimes called ‘bare theism’). This article considers the following epistemological issues: reasonableness of belief in the Judeo-Christian-Muslim God ("God," for short), the nature of reason, the claim that belief in God is not rational, defenses that it is rational, and approaches that recommend groundless belief in God or philosophical fideism.

Is belief in God rational? The evidentialist objector says “No” due to the lack of evidence. Theists who say “Yes” fall into two main categories: those who claim that there is sufficient evidence and those who claim that evidence is not necessary. Theistic evidentialists contend that there is enough evidence to ground rational belief in God, while Reformed epistemologists contend that evidence is not necessary to ground rational belief in God (but that belief in God is grounded in various characteristic religious experiences). Philosophical fideists deny that belief in God belongs in the realm of the rational. And, of course, all of these theistic claims are widely and enthusiastically disputed by philosophical non-theists.

Table of Contents

  1. Reason/Rationality
  2. The Evidentialist Objection to Belief in God
  3. The Reasonableness of Belief in God
    1. Theistic Evidentialism
    2. Sociological Digression
    3. Moral Analogy
    4. Reformed Epistemology
    5. Religious Experience
    6. Internalism/Externalism
    7. The Rational Stance
    8. Objections to Reformed Epistemology
  4. Groundless Believing
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Reason/Rationality

Reason is a fallible human tool for discovering truth or grasping reality. Although reason aims at the truth, it may fall short. In addition, rationality is more a matter of how one believes than what one believes. For example, one might irrationally believe something that is true: suppose one believed that the center of the earth is molten metal because one believes that he or she travels there every night (while it’s cool). And one might rationally believe what is false: it was rational for most people twenty centuries ago to believe that the earth is flat. And finally, rationality is person and situation specific: what is rational for one person at a particular socio-historical time and place might not be rational for another person at a different time and place; or, for that matter, what is rational for a person in the same time and place may be irrational for another person in the same time and place. This has relevance for a discussion of belief in God because “the rationality of religious belief” is typically discussed abstractly, independent of any particular believer and often believed to be settled once and for all either positively or negatively (say, by Aquinas or Hume respectively). The proper question should be, “Is belief in God rational for this person in that time and place?”

Rationality is a normative property possessed by a belief or a believer (although I’ve given reasons in the previous paragraph to suggest that rationality applies more properly to believers than to beliefs). Just precisely what this normative property is is a matter of great dispute. Some believe that we have intellectual duties (for example, to acquire true beliefs and avoid false beliefs, or to believe only on the basis of evidence or argument). Some deny that we have intellectual duties because, by and large, beliefs are not something we freely choose (e.g., look outside at a tree, consider the tree and try to choose not to believe that there’s a tree there; or, close your eyes and if you believe in God, decide not to believe or vice versa and now decide to believe in God again). Since we only have duties when we are free to fulfill or to not fulfill them (“Ought implies can”), we cannot have intellectual duties if we aren’t free to directly choose our beliefs. So, the normative property espoused by such thinkers might be intellectual permissibility rather than intellectual duty.

Since the time of the Enlightenment, reason has assumed a huge role for (valid or strong) inference: rationality is often a matter of assembling available (often empirical, typically propositional) evidence and assessing its deductive or inductive support for other beliefs; although some beliefs may and must be accepted without inference, the vast majority of beliefs or, more precisely, the vast majority of philosophical, scientific, ethical, theological and even common-sensical beliefs rationally require the support of evidence or argument. This view of reason is often taken ahistorically: rationality is simply a matter of timeless and non-person indexed propositional evidence and its logical bearing on the conclusion. If it can be shown that an argument is invalid or weak, belief in its conclusion would be irrational for every person in every time and place. This violates the viable intuition that rationality is person- and situation- specific. Although one argument for belief in God might be invalid, there might be other arguments that support belief in God. Or, supposing all of the propositional evidence for God’s existence is deficient, a person may have religious experience as the grounds of her belief in God.

Following Thomas Reid, we shall argue that ‘rationality’ in many of the aforementioned important cases need not, indeed cannot, require (valid or strong) inference. Our rational cognitive faculties include a wide variety of belief-producing mechanisms, few of which could or should pass the test of inference. We will let this view, and its significance for belief in God, emerge as the discussion proceeds.

2. The Evidentialist Objection to Belief in God

Belief in God is considered irrational for two primary reasons: lack of evidence and evidence to the contrary (usually the problem of evil, which won’t be discussed in this essay). Note that both of these positions reject the rationality of belief in God on the basis of an inference. Bertrand Russell was once asked, if he were to come before God, what he would say to God. Russell replied, “Not enough evidence God, not enough evidence.” Following Alvin Plantinga, we will call the claim that belief in God lacks evidence and is thus irrational the evidentialist objection to belief in God.

The roots of evidentialism may be found in the Enlightenment demand that all beliefs be subjected to the searching criticism of reason; if a belief cannot survive the scrutiny of reason, it is irrational. Kant’s charge is clear: “Dare to use your own reason.” Given increasing awareness of religious options, Hobbes would ask: “If one prophet deceive another, what certainty is there of knowing the will of God, by any other way than that of reason?” Although the Enlightenment elevation of Reason would come to be associated with a corresponding rejection of rational religious belief, many of the great Enlightenment thinkers were themselves theists (including, for example, Kant and Hobbes).

The evidentialist objection may be formalized as follows:

(1) Belief in God is rational only if there is sufficient evidence for the existence of God.

(2) There is not sufficient evidence for the existence of God.

(3) Therefore, belief in God is irrational.

The evidentialist objection is not offered as a disproof of the existence of God—that is, the conclusion is not "God does not exist." Rather the conclusion is, even if God were to exist, it would not be reasonable to believe in God. According to the evidentialist objection, rational belief in God hinges on the success of theistic arguments. Prominent evidentialist objectors include David Hume, W. K. Clifford, J. L. Mackie, Bertrand Russell and Michael Scriven. This view is probably held by a large majority of contemporary Western philosophers. Ironically, in most areas of philosophy and life, most philosophers are not (indeed could not be) evidentialists. We shall treat this claim shortly.

The claim that there is not sufficient evidence for belief in God is usually based on a negative assessment of the success of theistic proofs or arguments. Following Hume and Kant, the standard arguments for the existence of God—cosmological, teleological and ontological—are judged to be defective in one respect or another.

The claim that rational belief in God requires the support of evidence or argument is usually rooted in a view of the structure of knowledge that has come to be known as ‘classical foundationalism.’ Classical foundationalists take a pyramid or a house as metaphors for their conceptions of knowledge or rationality. A secure house or pyramid must have secure foundations sufficient to carry the weight of each floor of the house and the roof. A solid, enduring house has a secure foundation with each of the subsequent floors properly attached to that foundation. Ultimately, the foundation carries the weight of the house. In a classical foundationalist conception of knowledge, the foundational beliefs must likewise be secure, enduring and adequate to bear “the weight” of all of the non-foundational or higher-level beliefs. These foundational beliefs are characterized in such a manner to ensure that knowledge is built on a foundation of certitudes (following Descartes). The candidates for these foundational certitudes vary from thinker to thinker but, broadly speaking, reduce to three: if a belief is self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible, it is a proper candidate for inclusion among the foundations of rational belief.

What sorts of beliefs are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible? A self-evident belief is one that, upon understanding it, you see it to be true. While this definition is probably not self-evident, let’s proceed to understand it by way of example. Read the following fairly quickly:

(4) When equals are added to equals you get equals.

Do you think (4) is true? False? Not sure? Let me explain it. When equals (2 and 1+1) are added to equals (2 and 1+1) you get equals (4). Or, to make this clear 2 + 2 = 1 + 1 + 1 + 1. Now that you understand (4), you see it to be true. I didn’t argue for (4), I simply helped you to understand it, and upon understanding it, you saw it to be true. That is, (4) is self-evident. Typical self-evident beliefs include the laws of logic and arithmetic and some metaphysical principles like “An object can’t be red all over and blue all over at the same time.” A proposition is evident to the senses in case it is properly acquired by the use of one’s five senses. These sorts of propositions include “The grass is green,” “The sky is blue,” “Honey tastes sweet,” and “I hear a mourning dove.” Some epistemologists exclude propositions that are evident to the senses from the foundations of knowledge because of their lack of certainty [the sky may be colorless as a piece of glass but simply refracts blue light waves; we may be sampling artificial (and not real) honey; or someone may be blowing a bird whistle; etc.]. In order to ensure certainty, some have shifted to incorrigibility as the criterion of foundational beliefs. Incorrigible beliefs are first-person psychological states (seeming or appearance beliefs) about which I cannot be wrong. For example, I might be mistaken about the color of the grass or sky but I cannot be mistaken about the following: “The grass seems green to me” or “The sky appears to me to be blue.” I might be mistaken about the color of grass, and so such a belief is not certain for me, but I can’t be wrong about what the color of grass seems to be to me.

Now let us return to belief in God. Why do evidentialists hold (1), the claim that rational belief in God requires the support of evidence or argument? This is typically because they subscribe to classical foundationalism. A belief can be held without argument or evidence only if it is self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. Belief in God is not self-evident—it is not such that upon understanding the notion of God, you see that God exists. For example, Bertrand Russell understands the proposition “God exists” but does not see it to be true. So, belief in God is not a good candidate for self-evidence. Belief in God is not evident to the senses because God, by definition, transcends the sensory world. God cannot be seen, heard, touched, tasted or smelled. When people make claims such as “God spoke to me” or “I touched God,” they are using “spoke” and “touched” in a metaphorical sense, not a literal sense; literally, God is beyond the senses. So God’s existence is not evident to the senses. And finally, a person might be wrong about God’s existence and so belief in God cannot be incorrigible. Of course, “it seems to me that God exists” could be incorrigible but God’s seeming existence is a long way from God’s existence!

So, belief in God is neither self-evident, evident to the senses, nor incorrigible. Therefore, belief in God, according to classical foundationalism, cannot properly be included among the foundations of one’s rational beliefs. And, if it is not part of the foundations, it must be adequately supported by the foundational beliefs—that is, belief in God must be held on the basis of other beliefs and so must be argued to, not from. According to classical foundationalism, belief in God is not rational unless it is supported by evidence or argument. Classical foundationalism, as assumed in the Enlightenment, elevated theistic arguments to a status never held before in the history of Western thought. Although previous thinkers would develop theistic arguments, they seldom assumed that they were necessary for rational belief in God. After the period of the Enlightenment, thinkers in the grips of classical foundationalism would now hold belief in God up to the demand of rigorous proof.

3. The Reasonableness of Belief in God

There are two main strategies theists employ when responding to the evidentialist objection to belief in God. The first strategy is to argue against the second premise, the claim that there is insufficient evidence for the existence of God. The second strategy is to argue against the first premise, the claim that belief in God is rational only if it is supported by sufficient evidence.

a. Theistic Evidentialism

Consider first the claim that there is not sufficient evidence for the existence of God. This view has been historically rejected by Aristotle, Augustine, Anselm, Thomas Aquinas, John Duns Scotus, John Locke, William Paley and C. S. Peirce, to name but a few. But suppose we all agreed that the arguments offered by Aristotle and others for the existence of God were badly flawed. (“We know better now.”) Does that imply that earlier theists were irrational? Does the evidence have to support, in some timeless way—irrespective of any particular person—belief in God? Aristotle, Augustine, Aquinas, et al., were brilliant people doing the best they could with the most sophisticated belief-set available to them and judged, on the basis of their best lights, that the evidence supported belief in God. Are they nonetheless irrational? For example, suppose that, ignorant of the principle of inertia, Aquinas believed that God must be actively involved in the continual motion of the planets. That is, suppose that, using the best physics of his day, Aquinas believed in the scientific necessity of belief in God. According to his best lights, Aquinas thought that the evidence clearly supported belief in God. Would Aquinas be irrational? Evidentialist objectors might concede that Aquinas was not irrational, in spite of his bad arguments and, therefore, might not view rationality as being timeless. But, they would argue, it is no longer reasonable for anyone to believe in God because now we all see or should see that the evidence is clearly insufficient to support the conclusion that God exists. (This ‘we’ tends toward the princely philosophical.)

Some theists reject this conclusion, judging that there is adequate evidence to support God’s existence. Rejecting the idea that theistic arguments died along with Kant and Hume, these thinkers offer new evidence or refashion the old evidence for the existence of God. William Lane Craig (Craig and Smith 1993), for example, has developed a new version of the old Islamic Kalaam cosmological argument for the existence of God. This argument attempts to demonstrate the impossibility that time could have proceeded infinitely into the past so the universe must have had a beginning in time. In addition, both physicists and philosophers have argued that the apparent fine-tuning of the cosmological constants to permit human life is best explained by God’s intelligent superintendence. And some argue that irreducibly complex biological phenomena such as cells or kidneys could not have arisen by chance. Robert Merrihew Adams (1987) has revived moral arguments for the existence of God. Alvin Plantinga (1993b) has argued that naturalism and evolution are self-refuting. William Alston (1991) has defended religious experience as a source of justified belief in the existence of God. In addition, theistic arguments have been developed that are based on the existence of flavors, colors and beauty. And some thinkers, such as Richard Swinburne (1979, 1984), contend that the cumulative forces of these various kinds of evidence mutually reinforce the likelihood of God’s existence. Thus, there is an ample lot defending the claim that belief in God is rational based on the evidence (and an equal and opposite force opposing them). So the project of securing belief in God on the basis of evidence or argument is ongoing.

Many theists, then, concur with the evidentialist demand for evidence and seek to meet that demand by offering arguments that support the existence of God. Of course, these arguments have been widely criticized by atheistic evidentialists. But for better or for worse, many theistic philosophers have hitched the rationality of belief in God to the wagon of evidence.

Now suppose, as is the case, that the majority of philosophers believes that these attempts to prove God’s existence are feeble failures. Would that perforce make religious believers irrational? If one, by the best of one’s lights, judges that God exists given the carefully considered evidence, is one nonetheless irrational if the majority of the philosophical community happen to disagree? These questions suggest that judgments of rationality and irrationality are difficult to make. And, it suggests that rationality and irrationality may be more complicated than classical foundationalism assumes.

b. Sociological Digression

Very few philosophical positions (and this is an understatement) enjoy the kind of evidential support that classical foundationalism demands of belief in God; yet most of these are treated as rational. No philosophical position—belief in other minds, belief in the external world, the correspondence theory of truth or Quine’s indeterminacy of translation thesis—is properly based on beliefs that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. Indeed, we may question whether there is a single philosophical position that has been so amply justified (or could be). Why is belief in God held to a higher evidential standard than other philosophical beliefs? Some suggest that this demand is simply arbitrary at best or intellectually imperialist at worst.

c. Moral Analogy

Consider your moral beliefs. None of these beliefs will be self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. Now suppose you hold a moral belief that is not the philosophical fashion these days. Would you be irrational if the majority of contemporary philosophers disagreed with you? Perhaps you’d be irrational if moral beliefs contrary to yours could be established on the basis of widely known arguments from premises that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. But there may be no such arguments in the history of moral theory. Moral beliefs are not well-justified on the basis of argument or evidence in the classical foundationalist sense (or probably in any sense of “well-justified”). So, the fact that the majority of contemporary philosophers reject your moral beliefs (or belief in God for that matter) may have little or no bearing on the rationality of your beliefs. The sociological digression and moral analogy suggest that the philosophical emphasis on argument, certainty, and consensus for rationality might be misguided.

d. Reformed Epistemology

Let us now turn to those who reject the first premise of the evidentialist objection to belief in God, the claim that rational belief in God requires the support of evidence or argument. Recent thinkers such as Alvin Plantinga, Nicholas Wolterstorff and William Alston, in their so called Reformed Epistemology, have argued that belief in God does not require the support of evidence or argument in order for it to be rational (cf. Plantinga and Wolterstorff 1983). In so doing, they reject the evidentialist objector’s assumptions about rationality.

Reformed epistemologists argue that the first problem with the evidentialist objection is that the universal demand for evidence simply cannot be met in a large number of cases with the cognitive equipment that we have. No one has ever been able to offer proofs for the existence of other persons, inductive beliefs (e.g., that the sun will rise in the future), or the reality of the past (perhaps, as Bertrand Russell cloyingly puzzled, we were created five minutes ago with our memories intact) that satisfy classical foundationalist requirements for proof. So, according to classical foundationalism, belief in the past and inductive beliefs about the future are irrational. This list could be extended indefinitely.

There is also a limit to the things that human beings can prove. If we were required to prove everything, there would be an infinite regress of provings. There must be some truths that we can just accept and reason from. Thus, we can’t help but trust our cognitive faculties. Moreover, it seems that we will reach the limit of proof very quickly if, as classical foundationalism insists, the basis for inference includes only beliefs that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible. For these reasons, reformed epistemologists doubt that classical foundationalists are correct in claiming that the proper starting point of reason is self-evidence, evidence to the senses, and incorrigibility.

A second criticism of classical foundationalism, first offered by Plantinga, is that it is self-referentially inconsistent. That is, classical foundationalism must be rejected by its own account. Recall classical foundationalism (CF):

A proposition p is rational if and only if p is self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible or if p can be inferred from a set of propositions that are self-evident, evident to the senses, or incorrigible.

Consider CF itself. Is it rational, given its own conditions, to accept classical foundationalism? Classical foundationalism is not self-evident: upon understanding it many people believe it false. If one can understand a proposition and reject it, that proposition cannot be self-evident. CF is also not a sensory proposition—one doesn’t see, taste, smell, touch or hear it. So, classical foundationalism is not evident to the senses. And even if one should accept classical foundationalism, one might be wrong; so classical foundationalism is not incorrigible. Since classical foundationalism is neither self-evident, evident to the senses nor incorrigible, it can only be rationally maintained if it can be inferred from propositions that (ultimately) are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible. Is that possible? Consider a representative set of evidential propositions, E, that are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible:

Evidence (E):

    • When equals are added to equals you get equals.
    • 2 + 2 = 4
    • Grass is green.
    • The sky is blue.
    • Grass seems green to me.
    • The sky appears to me to be blue.


Limiting yourself to propositions that are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible, you can expand this list as exhaustively as you like. We have enough in E to make our case. Given E as evidence, can CF be inferred? Is E adequate evidence for CF? It’s hard to imagine how it could be. Indeed all of the propositions in E are irrelevant to the truth of CF. E simply cannot logically support CF. So, CF is not self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible, nor can CF be inferred from a set of propositions that are self-evident, evident to the senses or incorrigible. So, CF, by its own account, is irrational. If CF were true, it would be irrational to accept it. Better simply to reject it!

Thomas Reid (1710-1796), whom Plantinga and Wolterstorff follow, was an early critic of classical foundationalism. Reid argued that we have been outfitted with a host of cognitive faculties that produce beliefs that we can reason from (the foundations of believings). Plantinga calls these basic beliefs. The kinds of beliefs that we do and must reason to is a small subset of the kinds of beliefs that we do and must reason from. The latter must be accepted without the aid of proof. In most cases we must rely on our intellectual equipment to produce beliefs in the appropriate circumstances, without evidence or argument. For example, we simply find ourselves believing in other persons. A person is a center of self-conscious thoughts and feelings and first-person experience. While we can see a human face or a body, we can’t see another’s thoughts or feelings. Consider a person, Emily, whose leg is poked with a needle. We can see Emily recoil and her face screw up, and we can hear her yelp. So we can see Emily’s pain-behavior, but we cannot see her pain. The experience of pain is just the sort of inner experience that is typical of persons. For all we can know from Emily’s pain-behavior, she might be a cleverly constructed automaton (like Data of Star Trek fame or an exact human replica all the way down to the neurons). Or, for all we know, Emily might be a person just like us with the characteristic interior life and experience of persons. The point is, you can’t tell, just from Emily’s pain behavior, if she has any inner experience of pain. So you can’t tell by the things to which you have evidential access if Emily is a person. No one has ever been able to develop a successful argument to prove that there are other persons. So if classical foundationalism were true, it would not be reasonable to believe in the existence of other persons. But surely there are other persons whose existence it is reasonable to accept. So much the worse for classical foundationalism, Reidians say. Similar problems arise for classical foundationalism concerning beliefs in the past, the future, and the external world. No justification-conferring inference is or could be involved. Yet, the Reidian claims, we are perfectly within our epistemic rights in holding these basic beliefs. Thus, we should conclude that these beliefs are properly basic (that is, non-inferential but justified beliefs) and should reject classical foundationalism’s claim to the contrary.

Granting that a great many of our important beliefs are non-inferential, could one reasonably find oneself believing in God without evidence or argument? ‘Evidence’ is to be understood here as most evidentialists understand it, namely as the kind of propositional evidence one might find in a theistic argument and not the kind of experiential evidence typically thought to ground religious belief. Could belief in God be properly basic?

There are at least two reasons to believe that it might be rational for a person to accept belief in God without the support of an argument. The first is a parity argument. We must, by our nature, accept the deliverances of our cognitive faculties, including those that produce beliefs in the external world, other persons, that the future will be like the past, the reality of the past, and what other people tell us—just to name a few. For the sake of parity, we should trust the deliverances of the faculty that produces in us belief in the divine (what Plantinga (2000), following John Calvin, calls the sensus divinitatus, the sense of the divine). Of course, some philosophers deny that we have a sensus divinitatus and so reject the parity argument. The second reason is that belief in God is more like belief in a person than belief in a scientific hypothesis. Human relations demand trust, commitment, and faith. If belief in God is more like belief in other persons than belief in atoms, then the trust that is appropriate to persons will be appropriate to God. William James offers a similar argument in “The Will to Believe.”

Reformed epistemologists hold that one can reasonably believe in God—immediately and basically—without the support of an argument. One’s properly functioning cognitive faculties can produce belief in God in the appropriate circumstances with or without argument or evidence.

e. Religious Experience

Although Plantinga contends that belief in God does not require the support of propositional evidence or argument (like a theistic proof) in order to be rational, he does contend that belief in God is not groundless. According to Plantinga, belief in God is grounded in characteristic religious experiences such as beholding the divine majesty on the top of a mountain or the divine creativity when noticing the articulate beauty of the flower. Other sorts of alleged religious experiences involve a sense of guilt (and forgiveness), despair, the inner testimony of the Holy Spirit, or direct contact with the divine (mysticism). The experience of many believers is so vivid that they describe it with sensory metaphors: they claim to see, hear or be touched by God.

It is important to note that people who believe on the basis of religious experience do not typically construe their belief in God as based on an argument (any more than belief in other persons is based on an argument). They believe they have seen or heard God directly and find themselves overwhelmed by belief in God. Religious experience is typically taken as self-authenticating. In good Reidian fashion, one might simply take it that one has a cognitive faculty that can be trusted when it produces belief in God when induced by the appropriate experiences; that is, one is permitted to trust one’s initial alleged religious experience as veridical, just as one must trust that others of one’s cognitive faculties are veridical. (It should be noted that Reid himself does not make this claim. He believes that God’s existence can and should be supported by argument.) Richard Swinburne alleges that it is also reasonable to trust what others tell us unless and until we have good reason to believe otherwise. So, it would be reasonable for someone who did not have a religious experience to trust the veridicality of someone who did claim to have a religious experience. That is, it would be reasonable for everyone, not just the subject of the alleged religious experience, to believe in God on the basis of that alleged religious experience.

Some philosophers reject religious experience as a proper ground for religious belief. While not denying that some people have had powerful, so-called mystical experiences, they deny that one can reliably infer from that experience that the source or cause of that experience was God. Even the most enthusiastic mystics contend that some mystical experiences are illusory. So, how does one sort out the veridical from the illusory without begging the question? And if other evidence must be brought in to assess the validity of religious experience, is not then religious belief based more on that evidence than on the immediate experience? William Alston (1991) responds to these sorts of challenges by noting that perceptual experience, which is seldom questioned, is afflicted with precisely the same problems. Yet we do not take perceptual beliefs to be suspect. Alston argues that if religious experiences and the beliefs they produce relevantly resemble perceptual experiences and the beliefs they produce, then we should not hold beliefs based upon religious experience to be suspect either.

f. Internalism/Externalism

Some of the most important issues concerning the rationality of religious belief are framed in terms of the distinction between internalism and externalism in epistemology. Philosophers who are internalists with respect to rationality argue that we can tell, from the inside so to speak, if our beliefs are rationally justified. The language used by the classical foundationalist to describe basic beliefs is thoroughly internalist. ‘Self-evident’ and ‘evident to the senses’ are suggestive of beliefs that have a certain inner, compelling and unquestionable luminosity; one can simply inspect one’s beliefs and “see” if they are evident in the appropriate respects. And since deductive inference transfers rational justification from lower levels to higher levels, by carefully checking the inferential relations among one’s beliefs, one can see this luminosity passing from basic to non-basic beliefs. So internalists believe that rationality is something that can be discerned by the mental inspection of one’s own beliefs, items to which one has direct cognitive access.

Plantinga, on the other hand, argues that modern foundationalism has misunderstood the nature of rational justification. Plantinga calls the special property that turns true belief into knowledge “warrant.” According to Plantinga, a belief has warrant for one if and only if that belief is produced by one’s properly functioning cognitive faculties in circumstances to which those faculties are designed to apply; in addition, those faculties must be designed for the purpose of producing true beliefs. So, for instance, my belief that ‘there is a computer screen in front of me’ is warranted only if it is produced by my properly functioning perceptual faculties (and not by weariness or dreaming), if no one is tricking me, say, by having removed my computer and replaced it with an exact painting of my computer (thereby messing up my cognitive environment), and if my perceptual faculties have been designed (by God) for the purpose of producing true beliefs. Only if all of these conditions are satisfied is my belief that there is a computer screen in front of me warranted.

Note the portions of Plantinga’s definition which are not within one’s internal or direct purview: whether or not one’s faculties are functioning properly, whether or not one’s faculties are designed by God, whether or not one’s faculties are designed for the production of true beliefs, whether or not one is using one’s faculties in the environment intended for their use (one might be seeing a mirage and taking it for real). According to Plantinga’s externalism we cannot acquire warrant simply by attending to our beliefs. Warranted belief (knowledge) depends on circumstances external to the believing agent and so is not entirely up to us. Warrant depends crucially upon whether or not conditions that are not under our direct rational purview or conscious control are satisfied. If externalism is correct, then classical foundationalism has completely misunderstood the nature of epistemic warrant.

g. The Rational Stance

Because of the possibility of error, those who accept belief in God as a basic belief should nonetheless be concerned with evidence for and against belief in God. Following Reid, Reformed epistemologists contend that belief begins with trust (not suspicion, as the evidentialist apparently claims). Beliefs are, in their terms, innocent until proven guilty rather than guilty until proven innocent. In order to grasp reality, we must use and trust our cognitive faculties or capacities. But we also know that we get things wrong. The deliverances of our cognitive faculties are not infallible. Reid, Plantinga and Wolterstorff are keenly aware of human fallibility and recognize the need for a deliberative (reasoning) faculty that helps us adjudicate apparent conflicts among beliefs delivered innocently by our cognitive faculties. Reid’s general approach to rational belief is this: trust the beliefs produced by your cognitive faculties in the appropriate circumstances, unless you have good reason to reject them.

Let’s press the problem of error. As shown by widespread disagreement, our cognitive faculties seem less reliable in matters of fundamental human concern such as the nature of morality, the nature of persons, social and political thought, and belief in God. Given that rationality is truth-aimed, Reformed epistemologists should be willing to do two things to make the attainment of that goal more likely. First, they ought to seek, as best they can, supporting evidence for immediately produced beliefs of fundamental human concern. Because evidence is truth-conducive, it can lend credence to a basic belief. It doesn’t follow that basic beliefs about morality, God, etc. are irrational until such evidence is adduced; but perhaps one’s epistemic status on these matters can be improved by obtaining confirming evidence. This would make Reformed epistemology a paradigmatic example of the Augustinian view of faith and reason: fides quaerens intellectum (faith seeking understanding). Second, they ought to be open to contrary evidence to root out false beliefs. Given the likelihood that they could be wrong about these matters, they ought not close themselves off to the possibility of epistemic correction. If Reformed epistemologists are sincere truth-seekers, they should take the following stance:

The Rational Stance: Trust the deliverances of reason, seek supporting evidence, and be open to contrary evidence.

According to Reformed epistemology, evidence may not be required for belief in God to be rational. But, given the problem of error, it should nonetheless continue to play an important role in the life of the believer. Fides quaerens intellectum.

h. Objections to Reformed Epistemology

Reformed epistemology has been rejected for three primary reasons. First, some philosophers deny that we have a sensus divinitatus and so reject the parity argument. Second, some philosophers argue that Reformed epistemology is too latitudinarian, permitting the rational acceptability of virtually any belief. Gary Gutting calls this ‘the Great Pumpkin Objection’ because Charlie Brown could have written a defense of the sensus pumpkinus that is parallel to Plantinga’s defense of the sensus divinitatus. Finally, Reformed epistemology has been rejected because it has been perceived to be a form of fideism. Fideism is the view that belief in God should be held in the absence of or even in opposition to reason. According to this traditional definition of fideism, Reformed epistemology does not count as a form of fideism because it goes to great lengths to show that belief in God is rational. However, if one defines fideism as the view that belief in God may be rightly held in the absence of evidence or argument, then Reformed epistemology will be a kind of fideism.

4. Groundless Believing

With their emphasis on reason, very few philosophers aspire to fideism. Nonetheless, some major thinkers have denied that reason plays any significant role in the life of the religious believer. Tertullian’s rhetorical question, “What has Jerusalem to do with Athens?”, is meant to elicit the view that faith (the Jerusalem of Jesus) has little or nothing to do with reason (the Athens of Socrates, Plato and Aristotle). Tertullian would go on to say, “I believe because it’s absurd.” Pascal (1623-1662), Kierkegaard (1813-1855) and followers of Wittgenstein (late 20th C.) have all been accused of fideism (which is the philosophical equivalent of calling a US citizen a “commie” in the 1950s). Let us consider their positions.

Pascal’s wager brings costs and benefits into the analysis of the rationality of religious belief. Given the possibility that God exists and that the unbeliever will be punished with eternal damnation and the believer rewarded with eternal bliss, Pascal argues that it is rational to wager that God exists. Using a rational, prudential decision procedure he asks us to consider placing a bet on God’s existence. If one bets on God, then either God exists and one enjoys an eternity of bliss or God does not exist and one loses very little. On the other hand, if one bets against God and wins, one gains very little, but if one loses that bet, then the one will suffer in hell forever. Prudence demands that one should believe in God’s existence. Pascal concludes: “Wager, then, that God exists.”

Pascal’s wager has been widely criticized, but we shall only consider here the relevance of the wager to Pascal’s view of faith and reason. The wager is just one of his many tools for shocking people into caring about their eternal destinies. After arguing that our desires affect our abilities to discern the truth, he tries to get our desires appropriately oriented toward the truth. The wager can stimulate the desire to seek the truth about God and, after one’s desires are changed, the ability to judge the evidences for Christianity properly. So, in spite of the prominence of the wager and its apparent disregard for evidence, Pascal appears to be a kind of evidentialist after all (but not a classical foundationalist).

Søren Kierkegaard’s emphasis on the role of inwardness or subjective appropriation has played a role in his being understood as a fideist. His reaction against both rationalism and dogmatism led him to view faith as a certain madness, a “leap” one makes beyond what is reasonable (a leap into the absurd). Some philosophers argue that Kierkegaard is simply emphasizing that faith is more than rational assent to the truth of a proposition, involving more fundamentally the passionate commitment of the heart.

Finally, followers of the enigmatic Ludwig Wittgenstein have defended the groundlessness of belief in God, a view that has been called “Wittgensteinian fideism.” Wittgenstein’s later works both noticed and affirmed the tremendous variety of our beliefs that are not held because of reasons—such beliefs are, according to Wittgenstein, groundless. Many of Wittgenstein’s most prominent students are religious believers, some of whom took his general insights into the structure of human belief and applied them to religious belief. Norman Malcolm, for example, favorably compares belief in God to the belief that things don’t vanish into thin air. Both are part of the untested and untestable framework of human belief. These frameworks form the system of beliefs within which testing of other beliefs can take place. While we can justify beliefs within the framework, we cannot justify the framework itself. The giving of reasons must come to an end. And then we believe, groundlessly.

5. Conclusion

Is belief in God rational? The evidentialist objector says “No” due to the lack of evidence. Theists who say “Yes” fall into two main categories: those who claim that there is sufficient evidence and those who claim that evidence is not necessary. Theistic evidentialists contend that there is enough evidence to ground rational belief in God, while Reformed epistemologists contend that evidence is not necessary to ground rational belief in God (but that belief in God is grounded in various characteristic religious experiences). Philosophical fideists deny that belief in God belongs in the realm of the rational. And, of course, all of these theistic claims are widely and enthusiastically disputed by philosophical non-theists.

In Western European countries, religious belief has waned since the time of the Enlightenment. Yet there are counter trends. Today over 90% of Americans profess belief in a higher power. In China, after decades of institutionally enforced atheism, religious belief is dramatically on the rise. And even though religious belief has waned among professional Anglo-American philosophers since the Enlightenment, many prominent Anglo-American philosophers are theists. What conclusions can be drawn from these sociological observations? That Reason will eventually triumph over superstition as all countries eventually follow Western Europe’s lead? That irrational religious belief is so stubbornly tenacious that Reason is incapable of wiping it out? That the natural tendency to believe in God is overlaid by various forms of sin (such as greed in the West or wicked Communism in the East)? That once the evidence is made clear to a deprived peoples, rational belief in God will flourish? Of course, these sociological facts are irrelevant to discussions of rational belief in God. Yet they are relevant to this: the persistence of religious belief in various contexts will continue to spur discussions of and developments in the epistemology of the religious for succeeding generations.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Adams, Robert Merrihew. The Virtue of Faith and Other Essays. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1987.
  • Adams, Marilyn McCord and Robert Merrihew Adams, eds. The Problem of Evil. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Alston, William. Perceiving God. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1991.
  • Brockelman, Paul T. Cosmology and Creation: The Spiritual Significance of Contemporary Cosmology. New York: Oxford University Press, 1999.
  • Clark, Kelly James. Return to Reason: A Critique of Enlightenment Evidentialism and a Defense of Reason and Belief in God. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1990.
  • Craig, William Lane, and Quentin Smith. Theism, Atheism, and Big Bang Cosmology. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Davis, Stephen. God, Reason and Theistic Proofs. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1997.
  • Gutting, Gary. Religious Belief and Religious Skepticism. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1982.
  • Helm, Paul. Faith and Understanding. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 1997.
  • Hume, David. Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. New York: Routledge, 1779/1991.
  • Huxley, T. H. Agnosticism and Christianity, and Other Essays. Buffalo, NY: Prometheus Books, 1931/1992.
  • Jordan, Jeff, ed. Gambling on God, Lanham MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1994.
  • Le Poidevin, Robin. Arguing for Atheism: An Introduction to the Philosophy of Religion. New York: Routledge, 1996.
  • Murray, Michael, ed. Reason for the Hope Within. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1999.
  • Plantinga, Alvin, and Nicholas Wolterstorff, eds. Faith and Rationality: Reason and Belief in God. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1983.
  • Plantinga, Alvin.. Warrant: The Current Debate. New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warrant and Proper Function. New York: Oxford University Press, 1993.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Why I Am Not a Christian, and Other Essays on Religion and Related Subjects. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1957. Swinburne, Richard. The Existence of God. New York: Clarendon Press, 1979.
  • Swinburne, Richard. Faith and Reason. New York: Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Wainwright, William. Reason and the Heart: A Prolegomenon to a Critique of Passional Reason. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1995.Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Reason within the Bounds of Religion. Grand Rapids: Eerdmans, 1976.
  • Wolterstorff, Nicholas. Thomas Reid and the Story of Epistemology. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001.
  • Zagzebski, Linda, ed. Rational Faith: Catholic Responses to Reformed Epistemology. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1993.

Author Information

Kelly James Clark
Calvin College
U. S. A.


Philosophers are interested in a constellation of issues involving the concept of truth. A preliminary issue, although somewhat subsidiary, is to decide what sorts of things can be true. Is truth a property of sentences (which are linguistic entities in some language or other), or is truth a property of propositions (nonlinguistic, abstract and timeless entities)? The principal issue is: What is truth? It is the problem of being clear about what you are saying when you say some claim or other is true. The most important theories of truth are the Correspondence Theory, the Semantic Theory, the Deflationary Theory, the Coherence Theory, and the Pragmatic Theory. They are explained and compared here. Whichever theory of truth is advanced to settle the principal issue, there are a number of additional issues to be addressed:

  1. Can claims about the future be true now?
  2. Can there be some algorithm for finding truth – some recipe or procedure for deciding, for any claim in the system of, say, arithmetic, whether the claim is true?
  3. Can the predicate "is true" be completely defined in other terms so that it can be eliminated, without loss of meaning, from any context in which it occurs?
  4. To what extent do theories of truth avoid paradox?
  5. Is the goal of scientific research to achieve truth?

Table of Contents

  1. The Principal Problem
  2. What Sorts of Things are True (or False)?
    1. Ontological Issues
    2. Constraints on Truth and Falsehood
    3. Which Sentences Express Propositions?
    4. Problem Cases
  3. Correspondence Theory
  4. Tarski's Semantic Theory
    1. Extending the Semantic Theory Beyond "Simple" Propositions
    2. Can the Semantic Theory Account for Necessary Truth?
    3. The Linguistic Theory of Necessary Truth
  5. Coherence Theories
    1. Postmodernism: The Most Recent Coherence Theory
  6. Pragmatic Theories
  7. Deflationary Theories
    1. Redundancy Theory
    2. Performative Theory
    3. Prosentential Theory
  8. Related Issues
    1. Beyond Truth to Knowledge
    2. Algorithms for Truth
    3. Can "is true" be Eliminated?
    4. Can a Theory of Truth Avoid Paradox?
    5. Is The Goal of Scientific Research to Achieve Truth?
  9. References and Further Reading

1. The Principal Problem

The principal problem is to offer a viable theory as to what truth itself consists in, or, to put it another way, "What is the nature of truth?" To illustrate with an example – the problem is not: Is it true that there is extraterrestrial life? The problem is: What does it mean to say that it is true that there is extraterrestrial life? Astrobiologists study the former problem; philosophers, the latter.

This philosophical problem of truth has been with us for a long time. In the first century AD, Pontius Pilate (John 18:38) asked "What is truth?" but no answer was forthcoming. The problem has been studied more since the turn of the twentieth century than at any other previous time. In the last one hundred or so years, considerable progress has been made in solving the problem.

The three most widely accepted contemporary theories of truth are [i] the Correspondence Theory ; [ii] the Semantic Theory of Tarski and Davidson; and [iii] the Deflationary Theory of Frege and Ramsey. The competing theories are [iv] the Coherence Theory , and [v] the Pragmatic Theory . These five theories will be examined after addressing the following question.

2. What Sorts of Things are True (or False)?

Although we do speak of true friends and false identities, philosophers believe these are derivative uses of "true" and "false". The central use of "true", the more important one for philosophers, occurs when we say, for example, it's true that Montreal is north of Pittsburgh. Here,"true" is contrasted with "false", not with "fake" or "insincere". When we say that Montreal is north of Pittsburgh, what sort of thing is it that is true? Is it a statement or a sentence or something else, a "fact", perhaps? More generally, philosophers want to know what sorts of things are true and what sorts of things are false. This same question is expressed by asking: What sorts of things have (or bear) truth-values?

The term "truth-value" has been coined by logicians as a generic term for "truth or falsehood". To ask for the truth-value of P, is to ask whether P is true or whether P is false. "Value" in "truth-value" does not mean "valuable". It is being used in a similar fashion to "numerical value" as when we say that the value of "x" in "x + 3 = 7" is 4. To ask "What is the truth-value of the statement that Montreal is north of Pittsburgh?" is to ask whether the statement that Montreal is north of Pittsburgh is true or whether it is false. (The truth-value of that specific statement is true.)

There are many candidates for the sorts of things that can bear truth-values:

  • statements
  • sentence-tokens
  • sentence-types
  • propositions
  • theories
  • facts
  • assertions
  • utterances
  • beliefs
  • opinions
  • doctrines
  • etc.

a. Ontological Issues

What sorts of things are these candidates? In particular, should the bearers of truth-values be regarded as being linguistic items (and, as a consequence, items within specific languages), or are they non-linguistic items, or are they both? In addition, should they be regarded as being concrete entities, i.e., things which have a determinate position in space and time, or should they be regarded as abstract entities, i.e., as being neither temporal nor spatial entities?

Sentences are linguistic items: they exist in some language or other, either in a natural language such as English or in an artificial language such as a computer language. However, the term "sentence" has two senses: sentence-token and sentence-type. These three English sentence-tokens are all of the same sentence-type:

  • Saturn is the sixth planet from the Sun.
  • Saturn is the sixth planet from the Sun.
  • Saturn is the sixth planet from the Sun.

Sentence-tokens are concrete objects. They are composed of ink marks on paper, or sequences of sounds, or patches of light on a computer monitor, etc. Sentence-tokens exist in space and time; they can be located in space and can be dated. Sentence-types cannot be. They are abstract objects. (Analogous distinctions can be made for letters, for words, for numerals, for musical notes on a stave, indeed for any symbols whatsoever.)

Might sentence-tokens be the bearers of truth-values?

One reason to favor tokens over types is to solve the problems involving so-called "indexical" (or "token reflexive") terms such as "I" and "here" and "now". Is the claim expressed by the sentence-type "I like chocolate" true or false? Well, it depends on who "I" is referring to. If Jack, who likes chocolate, says "I like chocolate", then what he has said is true; but if Jill, who dislikes chocolate, says "I like chocolate", then what she has said is false. If it were sentence-types which were the bearers of truth-values, then the sentence-type "I like chocolate" would be both true and false – an unacceptable contradiction. The contradiction is avoided, however, if one argues that sentence-tokens are the bearers of truth-values, for in this case although there is only one sentence-type involved, there are two distinct sentence-tokens.

A second reason for arguing that sentence-tokens, rather than sentence-types, are the bearers of truth-values has been advanced by nominalist philosophers. Nominalists are intent to allow as few abstract objects as possible. Insofar as sentence-types are abstract objects and sentence-tokens are concrete objects, nominalists will argue that actually uttered or written sentence-tokens are the proper bearers of truth-values.

But the theory that sentence-tokens are the bearers of truth-values has its own problems. One objection to the nominalist theory is that had there never been any language-users, then there would be no truths. (And the same objection can be leveled against arguing that it is beliefs that are the bearers of truth-values: had there never been any conscious creatures then there would be no beliefs and, thus, no truths or falsehoods, not even the truth that there were no conscious creatures – an unacceptably paradoxical implication.)

And a second objection – to the theory that sentence-tokens are the bearers of truth-values – is that even though there are language-users, there are sentences that have never been uttered and never will be. (Consider, for example, the distinct number of different ways that a deck of playing cards can be arranged. The number, 8×1067 [the digit "8" followed by sixty-seven zeros], is so vast that there never will be enough sentence-tokens in the world's past or future to describe each unique arrangement. And there are countless other examples as well.) Sentence-tokens, then, cannot be identified as the bearers of truth-values – there simply are too few sentence-tokens.

Thus both theories – (i) that sentence-tokens are the bearers of truth-values, and (ii) that sentence-types are the bearers of truth-values – encounter difficulties. Might propositions be the bearers of truth-values?

To escape the dilemma of choosing between tokens and types, propositions have been suggested as the primary bearers of truth-values.

The following five sentences are in different languages, but they all are typically used to express the same proposition or statement.

Saturn is the sixth planet from the Sun. [English]
Saturn je šestá planeta od slunce. [Czech]
Saturne est la sixième planète la plus éloignée du soleil. [French]
Saturn er den sjette planeten fra solen. [Norwegian]

The truth of the proposition that Saturn is the sixth planet from the Sun depends only on the physics of the solar system, and not in any obvious way on human convention. By contrast, what these five sentences say does depend partly on human convention. Had English speakers chosen to adopt the word "Saturn" as the name of a different particular planet, the first sentence would have expressed something false. By choosing propositions rather than sentences as the bearers of truth-values, this relativity to human conventions does not apply to truth, a point that many philosophers would consider to be a virtue in a theory of truth.

Propositions are abstract entities; they do not exist in space and time. They are sometimes said to be "timeless", "eternal", or "omnitemporal" entities. Terminology aside, the essential point is that propositions are not concrete (or material) objects. Nor, for that matter, are they mental entities; they are not "thoughts" as Frege had suggested in the nineteenth century. The theory that propositions are the bearers of truth-values also has been criticized. Nominalists object to the abstract character of propositions. Another complaint is that it's not sufficiently clear when we have a case of the same propositions as opposed to similar propositions. This is much like the complaint that we can't determine when two sentences have exactly the same meaning. The relationship between sentences and propositions is a serious philosophical problem.

Because it is the more favored theory, and for the sake of expediency and consistency, the theory that propositions – and not sentences – are the bearers of truth-values will be adopted in this article. When we speak below of "truths", we are referring to true propositions. But it should be pointed out that virtually all the claims made below have counterparts in nominalistic theories which reject propositions.

b. Constraints on Truth and Falsehood

There are two commonly accepted constraints on truth and falsehood:

Every proposition is true or false. [Law of the Excluded Middle.]
No proposition is both true and false. [Law of Non-contradiction.]

These constraints require that every proposition has exactly one truth-value. Although the point is controversial, most philosophers add the further constraint that a proposition never changes its truth-value in space or time. Consequently, to say "The proposition that it's raining was true yesterday but false today" is to equivocate and not actually refer to just one proposition. Similarly, when someone at noon on January 15, 2000 in Vancouver says that the proposition that it is raining is true in Vancouver while false in Sacramento, that person is really talking of two different propositions: (i) that it rains in Vancouver at noon on January 15, 2000 and (ii) that it rains in Sacramento at noon on January 15, 2000. The person is saying proposition (i) is true and (ii) is false.

c. Which Sentences Express Propositions?

Not all sentences express propositions. The interrogative sentence "Who won the World Series in 1951?" does not; neither does the imperative sentence "Please close the window." Declarative (that is, indicative) sentences – rather than interrogative or imperative sentences – typically are used to express propositions.

d. Problem Cases

But do all declarative sentences express propositions? The following four kinds of declarative sentences have been suggested as not being typically used to express propositions, but all these suggestions are controversial.

1. Sentences containing non-referring expressions

In light of the fact that France has no king, Strawson argued that the sentence, "The present king of France is bald", fails to express a proposition. In a famous dispute, Russell disagreed with Strawson, arguing that the sentence does express a proposition, and more exactly, a false one.

2. Predictions of future events

What about declarative sentences that refer to events in the future? For example, does the sentence "There will be a sea battle tomorrow" express a proposition? Presumably, today we do not know whether there will be such a battle. Because of this, some philosophers (including Aristotle who toyed with the idea) have argued that the sentence, at the present moment, does not express anything that is now either true or false. Another, perhaps more powerful, motivation for adopting this view is the belief that if sentences involving future human actions were to express propositions, i.e., were to express something that is now true or false, then humans would be determined to perform those actions and so humans would have no free will. To defend free will, these philosophers have argued, we must deny truth-values to predictions.

This complicating restriction – that sentences about the future do not now express anything true or false – has been attacked by Quine and others. These critics argue that the restriction upsets the logic we use to reason with such predictions. For example, here is a deductively valid argument involving predictions:

We've learned there will be a run on the bank tomorrow.
If there will be a run on the bank tomorrow, then the CEO should be awakened.

So, the CEO should be awakened.

Without assertions in this argument having truth-values, regardless of whether we know those values, we could not assess the argument using the canons of deductive validity and invalidity. We would have to say – contrary to deeply-rooted philosophical intuitions – that it is not really an argument at all. (For another sort of rebuttal to the claim that propositions about the future cannot be true prior to the occurrence of the events described, see Logical Determinism.)

3. Liar Sentences

"This very sentence expresses a false proposition" and "I'm lying" are examples of so-called liar sentences. A liar sentence can be used to generate a paradox when we consider what truth-value to assign it. As a way out of paradox, Kripke suggests that a liar sentence is one of those rare declarative sentences that does not express a proposition. The sentence falls into the truth-value gap. See the article Liar Paradox.

4. Sentences that state moral, ethical, or aesthetic values

Finally, we mention the so-called "fact/value distinction." Throughout history, moral philosophers have wrestled with the issue of moral realism. Do sentences such as "Torturing children is wrong" – which assert moral principles – assert something true (or false), or do they merely express (in a disguised fashion) the speaker's opinions, or feelings or values? Making the latter choice, some philosophers argue that these declarative sentences do not express propositions.

3. Correspondence Theory

We return to the principal question, "What is truth?" Truth is presumably what valid reasoning preserves. It is the goal of scientific inquiry, historical research, and business audits. We understand much of what a sentence means by understanding the conditions under which what it expresses is true. Yet the exact nature of truth itself is not wholly revealed by these remarks.

Historically, the most popular theory of truth was the Correspondence Theory. First proposed in a vague form by Plato and by Aristotle in his Metaphysics, this realist theory says truth is what propositions have by corresponding to a way the world is. The theory says that a proposition is true provided there exists a fact corresponding to it. In other words, for any proposition p,

p is true if and only if p corresponds to a fact.

The theory's answer to the question, "What is truth?" is that truth is a certain relationship—the relationship that holds between a proposition and its corresponding fact. Perhaps an analysis of the relationship will reveal what all the truths have in common.

Consider the proposition that snow is white. Remarking that the proposition's truth is its corresponding to the fact that snow is white leads critics to request an acceptable analysis of this notion of correspondence. Surely the correspondence is not a word by word connecting of a sentence to its reference. It is some sort of exotic relationship between, say, whole propositions and facts. In presenting his theory of logical atomism early in the twentieth century, Russell tried to show how a true proposition and its corresponding fact share the same structure. Inspired by the notion that Egyptian hieroglyphs are stylized pictures, his student Wittgenstein said the relationship is that of a "picturing" of facts by propositions, but his development of this suggestive remark in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus did not satisfy many other philosophers, nor after awhile, even Wittgenstein himself.

And what are facts? The notion of a fact as some sort of ontological entity was first stated explicitly in the second half of the nineteenth century. The Correspondence Theory does permit facts to be mind-dependent entities. McTaggart, and perhaps Kant, held such Correspondence Theories. The Correspondence theories of Russell, Wittgenstein and Austin all consider facts to be mind-independent. But regardless of their mind-dependence or mind-independence, the theory must provide answers to questions of the following sort. "Canada is north of the U.S." can't be a fact. A true proposition can't be a fact if it also states a fact, so what is the ontological standing of a fact? Is the fact that corresponds to "Brutus stabbed Caesar" the same fact that corresponds to "Caesar was stabbed by Brutus", or is it a different fact? It might be argued that they must be different facts because one expresses the relationship of stabbing but the other expresses the relationship of being stabbed, which is different. In addition to the specific fact that ball 1 is on the pool table and the specific fact that ball 2 is on the pool table, and so forth, is there the specific fact that there are fewer than 1,006,455 balls on the table? Is there the general fact that many balls are on the table? Does the existence of general facts require there to be the Forms of Plato or Aristotle? What about the negative proposition that there are no pink elephants on the table? Does it correspond to the same situation in the world that makes there be no green elephants on the table? The same pool table must involve a great many different facts. These questions illustrate the difficulty in counting facts and distinguishing them. The difficulty is well recognized by advocates of the Correspondence Theory, but critics complain that characterizations of facts too often circle back ultimately to saying facts are whatever true propositions must correspond to in order to be true. Davidson has criticized the notion of fact, arguing that "if true statements correspond to anything, they all correspond to the same thing" (in "True to the Facts", Davidson [1984]). Davidson also has argued that facts really are the true statements themselves; facts are not named by them, as the Correspondence Theory mistakenly supposes.

Defenders of the Correspondence Theory have responded to these criticisms in a variety of ways. Sense can be made of the term "correspondence", some say, because speaking of propositions corresponding to facts is merely making the general claim that summarizes the remark that

(i) The sentence, "Snow is white", means that snow is white, and (ii) snow actually is white,

and so on for all the other propositions. Therefore, the Correspondence theory must contain a theory of "means that" but otherwise is not at fault. Other defenders of the Correspondence Theory attack Davidson's identification of facts with true propositions. Snow is a constituent of the fact that snow is white, but snow is not a constituent of a linguistic entity, so facts and true statements are different kinds of entities.

Recent work in possible world semantics has identified facts with sets of possible worlds. The fact that the cat is on the mat contains the possible world in which the cat is on the mat and Adolf Hitler converted to Judaism while Chancellor of Germany. The motive for this identification is that, if sets of possible worlds are metaphysically legitimate and precisely describable, then so are facts.

4. Tarski's Semantic Theory

tarskiTo capture what he considered to be the essence of the Correspondence Theory, Alfred Tarski created his Semantic Theory of Truth. In Tarski's theory, however, talk of correspondence and of facts is eliminated. (Although in early versions of his theory, Tarski did use the term "correspondence" in trying to explain his theory, he later regretted having done so, and dropped the term altogether since it plays no role within his theory.) The Semantic Theory is the successor to the Correspondence Theory. It seeks to preserve the core concept of that earlier theory but without the problematic conceptual baggage.

For an illustration of the theory, consider the German sentence "Schnee ist weiss" which means that snow is white. Tarski asks for the truth-conditions of the proposition expressed by that sentence: "Under what conditions is that proposition true?" Put another way: "How shall we complete the following in English: 'The proposition expressed by the German sentence "Schnee ist weiss" is true ...'?" His answer:

T: The proposition expressed by the German sentence "Schnee ist weiss" is true if and only if snow is white.

We can rewrite Tarski's T-condition on three lines:

  1. The proposition expressed by the German sentence "Schnee ist weiss" is true
  2. if and only if
  3. snow is white

Line 1 is about truth. Line 3 is not about truth – it asserts a claim about the nature of the world. Thus T makes a substantive claim. Moreover, it avoids the main problems of the earlier Correspondence Theories in that the terms "fact" and "correspondence" play no role whatever.

A theory is a Tarskian truth theory for language L if and only if, for each sentence S of L, if S expresses the proposition that p, then the theory entails a true "T-proposition" of the bi-conditional form:

(T) The proposition expressed by S-in-L is true, if and only if p.

In the example we have been using, namely, "Schnee ist weiss", it is quite clear that the T-proposition consists of a containing (or "outer") sentence in English, and a contained (or "inner" or quoted) sentence in German:

T: The proposition expressed by the German sentence "Schnee ist weiss" is true if and only if snow is white.

There are, we see, sentences in two distinct languages involved in this T-proposition. If, however, we switch the inner, or quoted sentence, to an English sentence, e.g. to "Snow is white", we would then have:

T: The proposition expressed by the English sentence "Snow is white" is true if and only if snow is white.

In this latter case, it looks as if only one language (English), not two, is involved in expressing the T-proposition. But, according to Tarski's theory, there are still two languages involved: (i) the language one of whose sentences is being quoted and (ii) the language which attributes truth to the proposition expressed by that quoted sentence. The quoted sentence is said to be an element of the object language, and the outer (or containing) sentence which uses the predicate "true" is in the metalanguage.

Tarski discovered that in order to avoid contradiction in his semantic theory of truth, he had to restrict the object language to a limited portion of the metalanguage. Among other restrictions, it is the metalanguage alone that contains the truth-predicates, "true" and "false"; the object language does not contain truth-predicates.

It is essential to see that Tarski's T-proposition is not saying:

X: Snow is white if and only if snow is white.

This latter claim is certainly true (it is a tautology), but it is no significant part of the analysis of the concept of truth – indeed it does not even use the words "true" or "truth", nor does it involve an object language and a metalanguage. Tarski's T-condition does both.

a. Extending the Semantic Theory Beyond "Simple" Propositions

Tarski's complete theory is intended to work for (just about) all propositions, expressed by non-problematic declarative sentences, not just "Snow is white." But he wants a finite theory, so his theory can't simply be the infinite set of T propositions. Also, Tarski wants his truth theory to reveal the logical structure within propositions that permits valid reasoning to preserve truth. To do all this, the theory must work for more complex propositions by showing how the truth-values of these complex propositions depend on their parts, such as the truth-values of their constituent propositions. Truth tables show how this is done for the simple language of Propositional Logic (e.g. the complex proposition expressed by "A or B" is true, according to the truth table, if and only if proposition A is true, or proposition B is true, or both are true).

Tarski's goal is to define truth for even more complex languages. Tarski's theory does not explain (analyze) when a name denotes an object or when an object falls under a predicate; his theory begins with these as given. He wants what we today call a model theory for quantified predicate logic. His actual theory is very technical. It uses the notion of Gödel numbering, focuses on satisfaction rather than truth, and approaches these via the process of recursion. The idea of using satisfaction treats the truth of a simple proposition such as expressed by "Socrates is mortal" by saying:

If "Socrates" is a name and "is mortal" is a predicate, then "Socrates is mortal" expresses a true proposition if and only if there exists an object x such that "Socrates" refers to x and "is mortal" is satisfied by x.

For Tarski's formal language of predicate logic, he'd put this more generally as follows:

If "a" is a name and "Q" is a predicate, then "a is Q" expresses a true proposition if and only if there exists an object x such that "a" refers to x and "Q" is satisfied by x.

The idea is to define the predicate "is true" when it is applied to the simplest (that is, the non-complex or atomic) sentences in the object language (a language, see above, which does not, itself, contain the truth-predicate "is true"). The predicate "is true" is a predicate that occurs only in the metalanguage, i.e., in the language we use to describe the object language. At the second stage, his theory shows how the truth predicate, when it has been defined for propositions expressed by sentences of a certain degree of grammatical complexity, can be defined for propositions of the next greater degree of complexity.

According to Tarski, his theory applies only to artificial languages – in particular, the classical formal languages of symbolic logic – because our natural languages are vague and unsystematic. Other philosophers – for example, Donald Davidson – have not been as pessimistic as Tarski about analyzing truth for natural languages. Davidson has made progress in extending Tarski's work to any natural language. Doing so, he says, provides at the same time the central ingredient of a theory of meaning for the language. Davidson develops the original idea Frege stated in his Basic Laws of Arithmetic that the meaning of a declarative sentence is given by certain conditions under which it is true—that meaning is given by truth conditions.

As part of the larger program of research begun by Tarski and Davidson, many logicians, linguists, philosophers, and cognitive scientists, often collaboratively, pursue research programs trying to elucidate the truth-conditions (that is, the "logics" or semantics for) the propositions expressed by such complex sentences as:

"It is possible that snow is white." [modal propositions]
"Snow is white because sunlight is white." [causal propositions]
"If snow were yellow, ice would melt at -4°C." [contrary-to-fact conditionals]
"Napoleon believed that snow is white." [intentional propositions]
"It is obligatory that one provide care for one's children." [deontological propositions]

Each of these research areas contains its own intriguing problems. All must overcome the difficulties involved with ambiguity, tenses, and indexical phrases.

b. Can the Semantic Theory Account for Necessary Truth?

Many philosophers divide the class of propositions into two mutually exclusive and exhaustive subclasses: namely, propositions that are contingent (that is, those that are neither necessarily-true nor necessarily-false) and those that are noncontingent (that is, those that are necessarily-true or necessarily-false).

On the Semantic Theory of Truth, contingent propositions are those that are true (or false) because of some specific way the world happens to be. For example all of the following propositions are contingent:

Snow is white. Snow is purple.
Canada belongs to the U.N. It is false that Canada belongs to the U.N.

The contrasting class of propositions comprises those whose truth (or falsehood, as the case may be) is dependent, according to the Semantic Theory, not on some specific way the world happens to be, but on any way the world happens to be. Imagine the world changed however you like (provided, of course, that its description remains logically consistent [i.e., logically possible]). Even under those conditions, the truth-values of the following (noncontingent) propositions will remain unchanged:

Truths Falsehoods
Snow is white or it is false that snow is white. Snow is white and it is false that snow is white.
All squares are rectangles. Not all squares are rectangles.
2 + 2 = 4 2 + 2 = 7

However, some philosophers who accept the Semantic Theory of Truth for contingent propositions, reject it for noncontingent ones. They have argued that the truth of noncontingent propositions has a different basis from the truth of contingent ones. The truth of noncontingent propositions comes about, they say – not through their correctly describing the way the world is – but as a matter of the definitions of terms occurring in the sentences expressing those propositions. Noncontingent truths, on this account, are said to be true by definition, or – as it is sometimes said, in a variation of this theme – as a matter of conceptual relationships between the concepts at play within the propositions, or – yet another (kindred) way – as a matter of the meanings of the sentences expressing the propositions.

It is apparent, in this competing account, that one is invoking a kind of theory of linguistic truth. In this alternative theory, truth for a certain class of propositions, namely the class of noncontingent propositions, is to be accounted for – not in their describing the way the world is, but rather – because of certain features of our human linguistic constructs.

c. The Linguistic Theory of Necessary Truth

Does the Semantic Theory need to be supplemented in this manner? If one were to adopt the Semantic Theory of Truth, would one also need to adopt a complementary theory of truth, namely, a theory of linguistic truth (for noncontingent propositions)? Or, can the Semantic Theory of Truth be used to explain the truth-values of all propositions, the contingent and noncontingent alike? If so, how?

To see how one can argue that the Semantic Theory of Truth can be used to explicate the truth of noncontingent propositions, consider the following series of propositions, the first four of which are contingent, the fifth of which is noncontingent:

  1. There are fewer than seven bumblebees or more than ten.
  2. There are fewer than eight bumblebees or more than ten.
  3. There are fewer than nine bumblebees or more than ten.
  4. There are fewer than ten bumblebees or more than ten.
  5. There are fewer than eleven bumblebees or more than ten.

Each of these propositions, as we move from the second to the fifth, is slightly less specific than its predecessor. Each can be regarded as being true under a greater range of variation (or circumstances) than its predecessor. When we reach the fifth member of the series we have a proposition that is true under any and all sets of circumstances. (Some philosophers – a few in the seventeenth century, a very great many more after the mid-twentieth century – use the idiom of "possible worlds", saying that noncontingent truths are true in all possible worlds [i.e., under any logically possible circumstances].) On this view, what distinguishes noncontingent truths from contingent ones is not that their truth arises as a consequence of facts about our language or of meanings, etc.; but that their truth has to do with the scope (or number) of possible circumstances under which the proposition is true. Contingent propositions are true in some, but not all, possible circumstances (or possible worlds). Noncontingent propositions, in contrast, are true in all possible circumstances or in none. There is no difference as to the nature of truth for the two classes of propositions, only in the ranges of possibilities in which the propositions are true.

An adherent of the Semantic Theory will allow that there is, to be sure, a powerful insight in the theories of linguistic truth. But, they will counter, these linguistic theories are really shedding no light on the nature of truth itself. Rather, they are calling attention to how we often go about ascertaining the truth of noncontingent propositions. While it is certainly possible to ascertain the truth experientially (and inductively) of the noncontingent proposition that all aunts are females – for example, one could knock on a great many doors asking if any of the residents were aunts and if so, whether they were female – it would be a needless exercise. We need not examine the world carefully to figure out the truth-value of the proposition that all aunts are females. We might, for example, simply consult an English dictionary. How we ascertain, find out, determine the truth-values of noncontingent propositions may (but need not invariably) be by nonexperiential means; but from that it does not follow that the nature of truth of noncontingent propositions is fundamentally different from that of contingent ones.

On this latter view, the Semantic Theory of Truth is adequate for both contingent propositions and noncontingent ones. In neither case is the Semantic Theory of Truth intended to be a theory of how we might go about finding out what the truth-value is of any specified proposition. Indeed, one very important consequence of the Semantic Theory of Truth is that it allows for the existence of propositions whose truth-values are in principle unknowable to human beings.

And there is a second motivation for promoting the Semantic Theory of Truth for noncontingent propositions. How is it that mathematics is able to be used (in concert with physical theories) to explain the nature of the world? On the Semantic Theory, the answer is that the noncontingent truths of mathematics correctly describe the world (as they would any and every possible world). The Linguistic Theory, which makes the truth of the noncontingent truths of mathematics arise out of features of language, is usually thought to have great, if not insurmountable, difficulties in grappling with this question.

5. Coherence Theories

The Correspondence Theory and the Semantic Theory account for the truth of a proposition as arising out of a relationship between that proposition and features or events in the world. Coherence Theories (of which there are a number), in contrast, account for the truth of a proposition as arising out of a relationship between that proposition and other propositions.

Coherence Theories are valuable because they help to reveal how we arrive at our truth claims, our knowledge. We continually work at fitting our beliefs together into a coherent system. For example, when a drunk driver says, "There are pink elephants dancing on the highway in front of us", we assess whether his assertion is true by considering what other beliefs we have already accepted as true, namely,

  • Elephants are gray.
  • This locale is not the habitat of elephants.
  • There is neither a zoo nor a circus anywhere nearby.
  • Severely intoxicated persons have been known to experience hallucinations.

But perhaps the most important reason for rejecting the drunk's claim is this:

  • Everyone else in the area claims not to see any pink elephants.

In short, the drunk's claim fails to cohere with a great many other claims that we believe and have good reason not to abandon. We, then, reject the drunk's claim as being false (and take away the car keys).

Specifically, a Coherence Theory of Truth will claim that a proposition is true if and only if it coheres with ___. For example, one Coherence Theory fills this blank with "the beliefs of the majority of persons in one's society". Another fills the blank with "one's own beliefs", and yet another fills it with "the beliefs of the intellectuals in one's society". The major coherence theories view coherence as requiring at least logical consistency. Rationalist metaphysicians would claim that a proposition is true if and only if it "is consistent with all other true propositions". Some rationalist metaphysicians go a step beyond logical consistency and claim that a proposition is true if and only if it "entails (or logically implies) all other true propositions". Leibniz, Spinoza, Hegel, Bradley, Blanshard, Neurath, Hempel (late in his life), Dummett, and Putnam have advocated Coherence Theories of truth.

Coherence Theories have their critics too. The proposition that bismuth has a higher melting point than tin may cohere with my beliefs but not with your beliefs. This, then, leads to the proposition being both "true for me" but "false for you". But if "true for me" means "true" and "false for you" means "false" as the Coherence Theory implies, then we have a violation of the law of non-contradiction, which plays havoc with logic. Most philosophers prefer to preserve the law of non-contradiction over any theory of truth that requires rejecting it. Consequently, if someone is making a sensible remark by saying, "That is true for me but not for you," then the person must mean simply, "I believe it, but you do not." Truth is not relative in the sense that something can be true for you but not for me.

A second difficulty with Coherence Theories is that the beliefs of any one person (or of any group) are invariably self-contradictory. A person might, for example, believe both "Absence makes the heart grow fonder" and "Out of sight, out of mind." But under the main interpretation of "cohere", nothing can cohere with an inconsistent set. Thus most propositions, by failing to cohere, will not have truth-values. This result violates the law of the excluded middle.

And there is a third objection. What does "coheres with" mean? For X to "cohere with" Y, at the very least X must be consistent with Y. All right, then, what does "consistent with" mean? It would be circular to say that "X is consistent with Y" means "it is possible for X and Y both to be true together" because this response is presupposing the very concept of truth that it is supposed to be analyzing.

Some defenders of the Coherence Theory will respond that "coheres with" means instead "is harmonious with". Opponents, however, are pessimistic about the prospects for explicating the concept "is harmonious with" without at some point or other having to invoke the concept of joint truth.

A fourth objection is that Coherence theories focus on the nature of verifiability and not truth. They focus on the holistic character of verifying that a proposition is true but don't answer the principal problem, "What is truth itself?"

a. Postmodernism: The Most Recent Coherence Theory

In recent years, one particular Coherence Theory has attracted a lot of attention and some considerable heat and fury. Postmodernist philosophers ask us to carefully consider how the statements of the most persuasive or politically influential people become accepted as the "common truths". Although everyone would agree that influential people – the movers and shakers – have profound effects upon the beliefs of other persons, the controversy revolves around whether the acceptance by others of their beliefs is wholly a matter of their personal or institutional prominence. The most radical postmodernists do not distinguish acceptance as true from being true; they claim that the social negotiations among influential people "construct" the truth. The truth, they argue, is not something lying outside of human collective decisions; it is not, in particular, a "reflection" of an objective reality. Or, to put it another way, to the extent that there is an objective reality it is nothing more nor less than what we say it is. We human beings are, then, the ultimate arbiters of what is true. Consensus is truth. The "subjective" and the "objective" are rolled into one inseparable compound.

These postmodernist views have received a more sympathetic reception among social scientists than among physical scientists. Social scientists will more easily agree, for example, that the proposition that human beings have a superego is a "construction" of (certain) politically influential psychologists, and that as a result, it is (to be regarded as) true. In contrast, physical scientists are – for the most part – rather unwilling to regard propositions in their own field as somehow merely the product of consensus among eminent physical scientists. They are inclined to believe that the proposition that protons are composed of three quarks is true (or false) depending on whether (or not) it accurately describes an objective reality. They are disinclined to believe that the truth of such a proposition arises out of the pronouncements of eminent physical scientists. In short, physical scientists do not believe that prestige and social influence trump reality.

6. Pragmatic Theories

A Pragmatic Theory of Truth holds (roughly) that a proposition is true if it is useful to believe. Peirce and James were its principal advocates. Utility is the essential mark of truth. Beliefs that lead to the best "payoff", that are the best justification of our actions, that promote success, are truths, according to the pragmatists.

The problems with Pragmatic accounts of truth are counterparts to the problems seen above with Coherence Theories of truth.

First, it may be useful for someone to believe a proposition but also useful for someone else to disbelieve it. For example, Freud said that many people, in order to avoid despair, need to believe there is a god who keeps a watchful eye on everyone. According to one version of the Pragmatic Theory, that proposition is true. However, it may not be useful for other persons to believe that same proposition. They would be crushed if they believed that there is a god who keeps a watchful eye on everyone. Thus, by symmetry of argument, that proposition is false. In this way, the Pragmatic theory leads to a violation of the law of non-contradiction, say its critics.

Second, certain beliefs are undeniably useful, even though – on other criteria – they are judged to be objectively false. For example, it can be useful for some persons to believe that they live in a world surrounded by people who love or care for them. According to this criticism, the Pragmatic Theory of Truth overestimates the strength of the connection between truth and usefulness.

Truth is what an ideally rational inquirer would in the long run come to believe, say some pragmatists. Truth is the ideal outcome of rational inquiry. The criticism that we don't now know what happens in the long run merely shows we have a problem with knowledge, but it doesn't show that the meaning of "true" doesn't now involve hindsight from the perspective of the future. Yet, as a theory of truth, does this reveal what "true" means?

7. Deflationary Theories

What all the theories of truth discussed so far have in common is the assumption that a proposition is true just in case the proposition has some property or other – correspondence with the facts, satisfaction, coherence, utility, etc. Deflationary theories deny this assumption.

a. Redundancy Theory

The principal deflationary theory is the Redundancy Theory advocated by Frege, Ramsey, and Horwich. Frege expressed the idea this way:

It is worthy of notice that the sentence "I smell the scent of violets" has the same content as the sentence "It is true that I smell the scent of violets." So it seems, then, that nothing is added to the thought by my ascribing to it the property of truth. (Frege, 1918)

When we assert a proposition explicitly, such as when we say "I smell the scent of violets", then saying "It's true that I smell the scent of violets" would be redundant; it would add nothing because the two have the same meaning. Today's more minimalist advocates of the Redundancy Theory retreat from this remark about meaning and say merely that the two are necessarily equivalent.

Where the concept of truth really pays off is when we do not, or can not, assert a proposition explicitly, but have to deal with an indirect reference to it. For instance, if we wish to say, "What he will say tomorrow is true", we need the truth predicate "is true". Admittedly the proposition is an indirect way of saying, "If he says tomorrow that it will snow, then it will snow; if he says tomorrow that it will rain, then it will rain; if he says tomorrow that 7 + 5 = 12, then 7 + 5 = 12; and so forth." But the phrase "is true" cannot be eliminated from "What he will say tomorrow is true" without producing an unacceptable infinite conjunction. The truth predicate "is true" allows us to generalize and say things more succinctly (indeed to make those claims with only a finite number of utterances). In short, the Redundancy Theory may work for certain cases, say its critics, but it is not generalizable to all; there remain recalcitrant cases where "is true" is not redundant.

Advocates of the Redundancy Theory respond that their theory recognizes the essential point about needing the concept of truth for indirect reference. The theory says that this is all that the concept of truth is needed for, and that otherwise its use is redundant.

b. Performative Theory

The Performative Theory is a deflationary theory that is not a redundancy theory. It was advocated by Strawson who believed Tarski's Semantic Theory of Truth was basically mistaken.

The Performative Theory of Truth argues that ascribing truth to a proposition is not really characterizing the proposition itself, nor is it saying something redundant. Rather, it is telling us something about the speaker's intentions. The speaker – through his or her agreeing with it, endorsing it, praising it, accepting it, or perhaps conceding it – is licensing our adoption of (the belief in) the proposition. Instead of saying, "It is true that snow is white", one could substitute "I embrace the claim that snow is white." The key idea is that saying of some proposition, P, that it is true is to say in a disguised fashion "I commend P to you", or "I endorse P", or something of the sort.

The case may be likened somewhat to that of promising. When you promise to pay your sister five dollars, you are not making a claim about the proposition expressed by "I will pay you five dollars"; rather you are performing the action of promising her something. Similarly, according to the Performative Theory of Truth, when you say "It is true that Vancouver is north of Sacramento", you are performing the act of giving your listener license to believe (and to act upon the belief) that Vancouver is north of Sacramento.

Critics of the Performative Theory charge that it requires too radical a revision in our logic. Arguments have premises that are true or false, but we don't consider premises to be actions, says Geach. Other critics complain that, if all the ascription of "is true" is doing is gesturing consent, as Strawson believes, then, when we say

"Please shut the door" is true,

we would be consenting to the door's being shut. Because that is absurd, says Huw Price, something is wrong with Strawson's Performative Theory.

c. Prosentential Theory

The Prosentential Theory of Truth suggests that the grammatical predicate "is true" does not function semantically or logically as a predicate. All uses of "is true" are prosentential uses. When someone asserts "It's true that it is snowing", the person is asking the hearer to consider the sentence "It is snowing" and is saying "That is true" where the remark "That is true" is taken holistically as a prosentence, in analogy to a pronoun. A pronoun such as "she" is a substitute for the name of the person being referred to. Similarly, "That is true" is a substitute for the proposition being considered. Likewise, for the expression "It is true." According to the Prosentential Theory, all uses of "true" can be reduced to uses either of "That is true" or "It is true" or variants of these with other tenses. Because these latter prosentential uses of the word "true" cannot be eliminated from our language during analysis, the Prosentential Theory is not a redundancy theory.

Critics of the theory remark that it can give no account of what is common to all our uses of the word "true," such as those in the unanalyzed operators "it-will-be-true-that" and "it-is-true-that" and "it-was-true-that".

8. Related Issues

a. Beyond Truth to Knowledge

For generations, discussions of truth have been bedeviled by the question, "How could a proposition be true unless we know it to be true?" Aristotle's famous worry was that contingent propositions about the future, such as "There will be a sea battle tomorrow", couldn't be true now, for fear that this would deny free will to the sailors involved. Advocates of the Correspondence Theory and the Semantic Theory have argued that a proposition need not be known in order to be true. Truth, they say, arises out of a relationship between a proposition and the way the world is. No one need know that that relationship holds, nor – for that matter – need there even be any conscious or language-using creatures for that relationship to obtain. In short, truth is an objective feature of a proposition, not a subjective one.

For a true proposition to be known, it must (at the very least) be a justified belief. Justification, unlike truth itself, requires a special relationship among propositions. For a proposition to be justified it must, at the very least, cohere with other propositions that one has adopted. On this account, coherence among propositions plays a critical role in the theory of knowledge. Nevertheless it plays no role in a theory of truth, according to advocates of the Correspondence and Semantic Theories of Truth.

Finally, should coherence – which plays such a central role in theories of knowledge – be regarded as an objective relationship or as a subjective one? Not surprisingly, theorists have answered this latter question in divergent ways. But the pursuit of that issue takes one beyond the theories of truth.

b. Algorithms for Truth

An account of what "true" means does not have to tell us what is true, nor tell us how we could find out what is true. Similarly, an account of what "bachelor" means should not have to tell us who is a bachelor, nor should it have to tell us how we could find out who is. However, it would be fascinating if we could discover a way to tell, for any proposition, whether it is true.

Perhaps some machine could do this, philosophers have speculated. For any formal language, we know in principle how to generate all the sentences of that language. If we were to build a machine that produces one by one all the many sentences, then eventually all those that express truths would be produced. Unfortunately, along with them, we would also generate all those that express false propositions. We also know how to build a machine that will generate only sentences that express truths. For example, we might program a computer to generate "1 + 1 is not 3", then "1 + 1 is not 4", then "1 + 1 is not 5", and so forth. However, to generate all and only those sentences that express truths is quite another matter.

Leibniz (1646-1716) dreamed of achieving this goal. By mechanizing deductive reasoning he hoped to build a machine that would generate all and only truths. As he put it, "How much better will it be to bring under mathematical laws human reasoning which is the most excellent and useful thing we have." This would enable one's mind to "be freed from having to think directly of things themselves, and yet everything will turn out correct." His actual achievements were disappointing in this regard, but his dream inspired many later investigators.

Some progress on the general problem of capturing all and only those sentences which express true propositions can be made by limiting the focus to a specific domain. For instance, perhaps we can find some procedure that will produce all and only the truths of arithmetic, or of chemistry, or of Egyptian political history. Here, the key to progress is to appreciate that universal and probabilistic truths "capture" or "contain" many more specific truths. If we know the universal and probabilistic laws of quantum mechanics, then (some philosophers have argued) we thereby indirectly (are in a position to) know the more specific scientific laws about chemical bonding. Similarly, if we can axiomatize an area of mathematics, then we indirectly have captured the infinitely many specific theorems that could be derived from those axioms, and we can hope to find a decision procedure for the truths, a procedure that will guarantee a correct answer to the question, "Is that true?"

Significant progress was made in the early twentieth century on the problem of axiomatizing arithmetic and other areas of mathematics. Let's consider arithmetic. In the 1920s, David Hilbert hoped to represent the sentences of arithmetic very precisely in a formal language, then to generate all and only the theorems of arithmetic from uncontroversial axioms, and thereby to show that all true propositions of arithmetic can in principle be proved as theorems. This would put the concept of truth in arithmetic on a very solid basis. The axioms would "capture" all and only the truths. However, Hilbert's hopes would soon be dashed. In 1931, Kurt Gödel (1906-1978), in his First Incompleteness Theorem, proved that any classical self-consistent formal language capable of expressing arithmetic must also contain sentences of arithmetic that cannot be derived within that system, and hence that the propositions expressed by those sentences could not be proven true (or false) within that system. Thus the concept of truth transcends the concept of proof in classical formal languages. This is a remarkable, precise insight into the nature of truth.

c. Can "is true" be Eliminated?

Can "is true" be defined so that it can be replaced by its definition? Unfortunately for the clarity of this question, there is no one concept of "definition". A very great many linguistic devices count as definitions. These devices include providing a synonym, offering examples, pointing at objects that satisfy the term being defined, using the term in sentences, contrasting it with opposites, and contrasting it with terms with which it is often confused. (For further reading, see Definitions, Dictionaries, and Meanings.)

However, modern theories about definition have not been especially recognized, let alone adopted, outside of certain academic and specialist circles. Many persons persist with the earlier, naive, view that the role of a definition is only to offer a synonym for the term to be defined. These persons have in mind such examples as: "'hypostatize' means (or, is a synonym for) 'reify'".

If one were to adopt this older view of definition, one might be inclined to demand of a theory of truth that it provide a definition of "is true" which permitted its elimination in all contexts in the language. Tarski was the first person to show clearly that there could never be such a strict definition for "is true" in its own language. The definition would allow for a line of reasoning that produced the Liar Paradox (recall above) and thus would lead us into self contradiction. (See the discussion, in the article The Liar Paradox, of Tarski's Udefinability Theorem of 1936.)

Kripke has attempted to avoid this theorem by using only a "partial" truth-predicate so that not every sentence has a truth-value. In effect, Kripke's "repair" permits a definition of the truth-predicate within its own language but at the expense of allowing certain violations of the law of excluded middle.

d. Can a Theory of Truth Avoid Paradox?

The brief answer is, "Not if it contains its own concept of truth." If the language is made precise by being formalized, and if it contains its own so-called global truth predicate, then Tarski has shown that the language will enable us to reason our way to a contradiction. That result shows that we do not have a coherent concept of truth (for a language within that language). Some of our beliefs about truth, and about related concepts that are used in the argument to the contradiction, must be rejected, even though they might seem to be intuitively acceptable.

There is no reason to believe that paradox is to be avoided by rejecting formal languages in favor of natural languages. The Liar Paradox first appeared in natural languages. And there are other paradoxes of truth, such as Löb's Paradox, which follow from principles that are acceptable in either formal or natural languages, namely the principles of modus ponens and conditional proof.

The best solutions to the paradoxes use a similar methodology, the "systematic approach". That is, they try to remove vagueness and be precise about the ramifications of their solutions, usually by showing how they work in a formal language that has the essential features of our natural language. The Liar Paradox and Löb's Paradox represent a serious challenge to understanding the logic of our natural language. The principal solutions agree that – to resolve a paradox – we must go back and systematically reform or clarify some of our original beliefs. For example, the solution may require us to revise the meaning of "is true". However, to be acceptable, the solution must be presented systematically and be backed up by an argument about the general character of our language. In short, there must be both systematic evasion and systematic explanation. Also, when it comes to developing this systematic approach, the goal of establishing a coherent basis for a consistent semantics of natural language is much more important than the goal of explaining the naive way most speakers use the terms "true" and "not true". The later Wittgenstein did not agree. He rejected the systematic approach and elevated the need to preserve ordinary language, and our intuitions about it, over the need to create a coherent and consistent semantical theory.

e. Is The Goal of Scientific Research to Achieve Truth?

Except in special cases, most scientific researchers would agree that their results are only approximately true. Nevertheless, to make sense of this, philosophers need adopt no special concept such as "approximate truth." Instead, it suffices to say that the researchers' goal is to achieve truth, but they achieve this goal only approximately, or only to some approximation.

Other philosophers believe it's a mistake to say the researchers' goal is to achieve truth. These "scientific anti-realists" recommend saying that research in, for example, physics, economics, and meteorology, aims only for usefulness. When they aren't overtly identifying truth with usefulness, the instrumentalists Peirce, James and Schlick take this anti-realist route, as does Kuhn. They would say atomic theory isn't true or false but rather is useful for predicting outcomes of experiments and for explaining current data. Giere recommends saying science aims for the best available "representation", in the same sense that maps are representations of the landscape. Maps aren't true; rather, they fit to a better or worse degree. Similarly, scientific theories are designed to fit the world. Scientists should not aim to create true theories; they should aim to construct theories whose models are representations of the world.

9. References and Further Reading

  • Bradley, Raymond and Norman Swartz . Possible Worlds: an Introduction to Logic and Its Philosophy, Hackett Publishing Company, 1979.
  • Davidson, Donald. Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, Oxford University Press, 1984.
  • Davidson, Donald. "The Structure and Content of Truth", The Journal of Philosophy, 87 (1990), 279-328.
  • Horwich, Paul. Truth, Basil Blackwell Ltd., 1990.
  • Mates, Benson. "Two Antinomies", in Skeptical Essays, The University of Chicago Press, 1981, 15-57.
  • McGee, Vann. Truth, Vagueness, and Paradox: An Essay on the Logic of Truth, Hackett Publishing, 1991.
  • Kirkham, Richard. Theories of Truth: A Critical Introduction, MIT Press, 1992.
  • Kripke, Saul. "Outline of a Theory of Truth", Journal of Philosophy, 72 (1975), 690-716.
  • Quine, W. V. "Truth", in Quiddities: An Intermittently Philosophical Dictionary, The Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 1987.
  • Ramsey, F. P. "Facts and Propositions", in Proceedings of the Arisotelian Society, Supplement, 7, 1927.
  • Russell, B. The Problems of Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 1912.
  • Strawson, P. F. "Truth", in Analysis, vol. 9, no. 6, 1949.
  • Tarski, Alfred, "The Semantic Conception of Truth and the Foundations of Semantics", in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 4 (1944).
  • Tarski, Alfred. "The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages", in Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics, Clarendon Press, 1956.

Author Information

Bradley Dowden
California State University Sacramento
U. S. A.

Norman Swartz
Simon Fraser University

Prosentential Theory of Truth

Prosentential theorists claim that sentences such as "That is true" are prosentences that function analogously to their better known cousins—pronouns. For example, just as we might use the pronoun 'he' in place of 'James' to transform "James went to the supermarket" into "He went to the supermarket," so we might use the prosentence-forming operator 'is true' to transform "Snow is white" into "'Snow is white' is true." According to the prosentential theory of truth, whenever a referring expression (for example, a definite description or a quote-name) is joined to the truth predicate, the resulting statement contains no more content than the sentence(s) picked out by the referring expression. To assert that a sentence is true is simply to assert or reassert that sentence; it is not to ascribe the property of truth to that sentence. The prosentential theory is one kind of deflationary theory of truth. Like all deflationary theories, it provides an alternative to explanations of truth that analyze truth in terms of reference, predicate satisfaction or a correspondence relation.

Table of Contents

  1. What is a Prosentence?
  2. Quantificational Prosentences
  3. Why the Prosentential Theory is Deflationary
  4. The Recognition-Transcendence of Truth
  5. A Prosentential Theory of Falsity
  6. The Liar Paradox
  7. Objections
  8. Prosentential Theory vs. Other Deflationary Theories
  9. References and Further Reading

1. What is a Prosentence?

The prosentential theory was first developed by Dorothy Grover, Joseph Camp, Jr., and Nuel Belnap, Jr. (1975) and Grover (1992) and has received renewed attention due to the work of Robert Brandom (1994). The central claim of the prosentential theory is that ‘x is true’ functions as a prosentence-forming operator rather than a property-ascribing locution. Perhaps the best way to begin an explication of the prosentential theory is by looking at the more familiar proforms found in ordinary English usage. ‘Proform’ is the generic name for the linguistic category of expressions that ‘stand in’ for other expressions—pronouns being the most familiar variety.

Most uses of pronouns are lazy—the antecedents of the pronouns could have easily been used instead of the pronouns. For example,

(1) Mary wanted to buy a car, but she could only afford a motorbike.

(2) If she can afford it, Jane will go.

(3) John visited us. It was a surprise.

(4) Mary said that the moon is made of green cheese, but I didn’t believe it.

‘She’ simply stands in for ‘Mary’ in (1), and ‘she’ stands in for ‘Jane’ in (2), even though ‘she’ appears before ‘Jane.’ In (3) ‘it’ refers to the event of John’s having visited us, while in (4) ‘it’ refers to Mary’s statement. Lazy uses of pronouns are convenient but perhaps not essential linguistic conventions.

In addition to lazy uses of pronouns, there are also ‘quantificational uses,’ as in:

(5) If any car overheats, don’t buy it.

(6) Each positive integer is such that if it is even, adding 1 to it yields an odd number.

In these cases, the pronouns do not pick up their referents from their antecedents in the same straightforward way as pronouns of laziness do. Replacing the ‘it’ in (5) by the apparent antecedent ‘any car’ or the ‘it’ in (6) by ‘each positive integer’ yields the following.

(5') If any car overheats, don’t buy any car.

(6') Each positive integer is such that if each positive integer is even, adding 1 to each positive integer yields an odd number.

(5') and (6') obviously do not express the sense of the original sentences. ‘Any car’ and ‘each positive integer’ cannot be construed as referring expressions; rather, they pick out families of admissible expressions that can be substituted into the claims. (5) and (6) should be represented as

(5") (x)[(x is a car & x overheats) → don’t buy x].

(6") (x)[(x is a positive integer & x is even) → adding 1 to x yields an odd number].

More will be said about quantificational proforms below.

There are also many commonly used proforms that are not often recognized as proforms. These include proverbs:

(7) Dance as we do

(8) Mary ran quickly, so Bill did too


(9) We must strive to make men happy and to keep them so

and proadverbs:

(10) She twitched violently, and while so twitching, expired.

Most importantly, defenders of the prosentential theory of truth claim that English also contains prosentences. For example,

(11) Bill: There are people on Mars. Mary: That is true.

(12) John: Bill claims that there are people on Mars but I don’t believe that it is true.

In these examples, ‘that is true’ and ‘it is true’ serve as ‘prosentences of laziness.’ They inherit their content from antecedent statements, just as pronouns inherit their reference from antecedent singular terms. John’s use of ‘it is true’ is lazy because he could have easily repeated the content of Bill’s claim without using a prosentence. John could have said the following.

(12') John: Bill claims that there are people on Mars but I don’t believe that there are people on Mars.

The relation between a proform and its antecedent is called a relation of ‘anaphora.’ Defenders of the prosentential theory claim that prosentences such as ‘it is true’ and ‘that is true’ do not have any content of their own. Whatever content they have is inherited from their anaphoric antecedents. Because prosentences simply stand in for other sentences, prosentential theorists claim that utterances of ‘p’ and ‘p is true’ always have the same content.

There are many more kinds of prosentences than ‘that is true’ or ‘it is true.’ Each of the following sentences, for example, is also a prosentence.

(13) Goldbach’s conjecture is true.

(14) ‘Snow is white’ is true.

(15) The claim that grass is green is true.

According to the prosentential theory, sentences (13), (14) and (15) say no more than sentences (16), (17) and (18), respectively.

(16) Every even number is the sum of two primes.

(17) Snow is white.

(18) Grass is green.

Each prosentence is formed by conjoining some expression that refers to a sentence to the truth predicate.

Although the semantic content of prosentences and their antecedents is the same, prosentences often differ in pragmatic respects from their antecedents. Consider the difference between the following cases:

(11) Bill: There are people on Mars. Mary: That is true.

(11') Bill: There are people on Mars. Mary: There are people on Mars.

Although Mary’s utterance in (11') asserts no more than her utterance in (11), her utterance in (11') does not acknowledge that Bill has said anything. By acknowledging Bill’s previous statement, Mary’s utterance of ‘that is true’ avoids a kind of assertional plagiarism and has the effect of expressing agreement. Mary could have uttered her statement in (11') without ever having heard Bill say anything and without, therefore, expressing any kind of agreement. Thus, the prosentential theory takes up the point emphasized by F. P. Ramsey’s redundancy theory of truth that assertions of truth do not assert anything new. Unlike redundancy theories, however, the prosentential theory does not take the truth predicate to be always eliminable without loss. What would be lost in (11') is Mary’s acknowledgment that Bill had said something.

One of the prosentential theory’s most important claims about the truth predicate is that it is not used to ascribe a substantive property to propositions. Grover (1992, p. 221) writes,

Many other truth theories assume that a sentence containing a truth predication, e.g., ‘That is true,’ is about its antecedent sentence (‘Chicago is large’) or an antecedent proposition. By contrast, the prosentential account is that ‘That is true’ does not say anything about its antecedent sentence (e.g., ‘Chicago is large’) but says something about an extralinguistic subject (e.g., Chicago).

The truth predicate is not used to say something about sentences or propositions. It is used to say something about the world. As Grover (1992, p. 221) puts it, prosentences function “at the level of the object language.” Even when someone makes an utterance such as “John’s last claim is true”—which uses a referring expression that explicitly mentions an antecedent utterance token—the prosentential theory still denies that it is the utterance that is being talked about. The person uttering this sentence “expresses an opinion about whatever (extralinguistic thing) it was that John expressed an opinion about” (Grover, 1992, p. 19). W. V. Quine (1970, pp. 10-11) makes a similar claim, stating that the truth predicate serves “to point through the sentence to reality; it serves as a reminder that though sentences are mentioned, reality is still the whole point.” The prosentential theory uses the notion of the anaphoric inheritance of content to explain how reality remains the focus in such cases.

2. Quantificational Prosentences

In addition to lazy uses of prosentences, there are also ‘quantificational’ uses. For example,

(19) Everything John said is true

is a quantificational prosentence. A first attempt to translate (19) into a language containing bound propositional variables might read

(20) (p)(If John said that p, then p is true).

A natural language paraphrase of (20) which exhibits ‘it is true’ as a quantificationally dependent prosentence would be

(21) For anything one can say, if John said it, then it is true. (Grover, 1992, p. 130)

Since, according to the prosentential theory, the statement ‘p is true’ says no more than the statement ‘p,’ the truth predicate in (20) can be dropped to yield

(20') (p)(If John said that p, then p).

If the variable ‘p’ ranges over objects and take names of objects as its substitution instances—i.e., if ‘(p)’ and ‘p’ are given their ordinary interpretations—then the consequent of the conditional inside (20') will not be a grammatical expression. The antecedents and consequents of conditionals must be complete sentences. In order for (20') to be a grammatical expression, two modifications in the standard interpretation of variables and quantifiers must be made. First, the variable ‘p’ must be understood to be a propositional variable, taking entire propositions instead of names of propositions as its substitution instances. Secondly, the universal quantifier ‘(p)’ must be understood substitutionally, since the traditional, objectual interpretation of the quantifiers does not square well with the use of propositional variables. A statement using the particular (or existential) substitutional quantifier is true just in case the open sentence following the quantifier has at least one true substitution instance; while a statement using the universal substitutional quantifier is true in case every substitution instance is true (cf. David, 1994, p. 85). In order to avoid confusion between the objectual and substitutional interpretations of the quantifiers, I shall use ‘∀p’ to designate the universal substitutional quantifier. (20'), then, should read

(20") ∀p(If John said that p, then p).

If, however, we interpret the conditional in (20") as a material conditional, (20") will still misrepresent the content of (19).

To see why this is so, consider the fact that universally quantified statements can be understood as conjunctions of all their possible substitution instances. For example, (20") is equivalent to

(22) (If John said that p1, then p1 is true) & (If John said that p2, then p2 is true) & (If John said that p3, then p3 is true) & … & (If John said that pn, then pn is true).

How many conjuncts make up the content of (22) will depend upon the size of the domain of discourse in question. That is, it will depend upon how many possible values of p there are. If the domain of the variable ‘p’ is the set of all things that can be said, then (22) will consist of an indefinitely large conjunction of substitution instances. Most of the conjuncts will be vacuously true by virtue of having false antecedents—i.e., there will be indefinitely many things that John did not say. This means that each of the indefinitely many conditionals formed from things that John did not say is just as much part of the content of (19) as each of the conditionals formed from things John did say. That seems counterintuitive and contrary to the meaning of (19). Suppose that John made only the following three statements on the occasion in question.

(23) Gas prices are too high.

(24) Taxes are too high.

(25) Professional baseball players’ salaries are too high.

It is plausible to think that (19) says something about (23), (24) and (25) but not about (26), (27) and (28)—statements John never made.

(26) Gas prices are too low.

(27) Taxes are too low.

(28) Professional baseball players’ salaries are too low.

Yet if the quantification in (20") remains unrestricted, then its content consists of a conjunction of conditionals having (26), (27), (28) and countless other statements John did not say in their antecedents.

If quantificational prosentences such as ‘Everything John said is true’ are to refer to only finite classes of claims, their quantifiers must be restricted in some way. One way to trim down the domain of ‘p’ in (20") is to limit the universe of discourse to the set of all statements made by John. Let ‘UJ’ represent some particular universe of discourse, and let ‘{p|Øp}’ mean ‘the set of all propositions such that ‘Øp’ is true.’ If we limit the universe of discourse to all and only the things that John said, then we have

(29) ∀p(If John said that p, then p). UJ = {p|John said p}

‘∀p(If John said that p, then p)’ will then consist of a finite conjunction of true conditionals, one for each thing said by John on the occasion in question. This arrangement, however, has the unusual feature that, for every grammatical subject of such a universally quantified sentence, there will be a different universe of discourse. For every x, there will be a unique universe of discourse for each statement of the form

(30) ∀p(If x said that p, then p). Ux = {p|x said p}

Other quantificational prosentences that would be instances of (30) include

(31) Everything the Pope says about theological doctrine is true.

(32) Everything Henry Kissinger says about foreign policy is true.

Following the current suggestion, (31) could be symbolized as either

(33) ∀p(If the Pope said that p, then p). UP = {p|the Pope said p & p is a matter of theological doctrine}


(33') ∀p(If the Pope said that p & p is a matter of theological doctrine, then p). UP = {p|the Pope said p}

The symbolization for (32) would be analogous. It is not clear that we will be able to capture what is common to all of these cases if each quantificational prosentence is tied to a distinct universe of discourse. Perhaps there is another way to limit the domain of ‘p’ in (20").

Nuel Belnap, Jr. (1973), one of the founders of the prosentential theory of truth, introduced the notion of ‘conditional assertion’ to solve the problem of restricted quantification—i.e., where one wants to quantify over only a limited domain. All prosentential theorists now rely upon Belnap’s model to explicate the logical structure of quantificational prosentences. Belnap introduced the notation ‘(A/B)’ to stand for conditional assertion. Conditional assertion occurs when someone does not assert the conditional ‘If A then B’ as much as conditionally assert B—that is, assert B on the condition that A. Belnap formulates the following principle to capture this idea:

(B1) If A is true, then what (A/B) asserts is what B asserts. If A is false, then (A/B) is nonassertive. (Belnap, 1973, p. 50)

Quantifying into conditional assertions yields a restricted form of quantification, regarding which Belnap offers the following principle.

(B2) Part 1. (x)(Cx/Bx) is assertive just in case ∃xCx is true. Part 2. (x)(Cx/Bx) is the conjunction of all the propositions (Bt) such that Ct is true. (ibid., p. 66)

Applying Belnap’s conditional assertion notation to (20") yields

(34) ∀p(John said that p/p).

The content of (34), then, is a finite conjunction of claims. But notice that it is not a conjunction of conditionals of the form ‘If John said that p, then p,’ each with a true antecedent. Rather, it is a conjunction of claims p1, p2,…, pn, each of which satisfies the condition that John said it. The focus of such a claim is on what John said and only derivatively on the fact that it was John who did the saying. If the only statements John made were (23), (24) and (25), then the content of an assertion of (34) is exhausted by the conjunction of (23), (24) and (25). As a result, Belnap’s principle of restricted quantification solves the problem of how to interpret ‘Everything John said is true.’ Applying Belnap’s principles to (31) and (32) yields

(35) ∀p(the Pope said that p & p is a matter of theological doctrine/p).

(36) ∀p(Kissinger said that p & p is a matter of foreign policy/p).

Following Belnap’s interpretation of conditional assertion and restricted quantification, prosentential theorists can explain how quantificational prosentences have as their content finite conjunctions of claims rather than infinite conjunctions of conditionals, most of which are trivially true. Prosentential theorists thereby show that quantificational prosentences contain no more content than the anaphoric antecedents of those prosentences. Although quantificational prosentences may contain no more explicit content than their anaphoric antecedents, they can also be used as implicit attributions of reliability, where such attributions do not clearly appear in their antecedents. Cf. Beebe (forthcoming).

3. Why the Prosentential Theory is Deflationary

The prosentential theory of truth counts as a deflationary theory because it denies that any analysis of truth of the form

(37) (x)(x is true iff x is F)

can be given, where ‘x is F’ expresses a property that is conceptually or explanatorily more fundamental than ‘x is true.’ An analysis of truth would be appropriate if the truth predicate were a property-ascribing locution and the property that is ascribed could be broken down into more fundamental properties. However, prosentential theorists deny that uses of the truth predicate ascribe any property to sentences or propositions.

A common anti-deflationist approach to truth analyzes truth in terms of reference and predicate satisfaction. Stephen Stich (1990, ch. 5), for example, takes the proper analysis of truth to be

(38) ‘a is F’ is true iff there exists an object x such that ‘a’ refers to x and ‘F’ is satisfied by x.

Instead of denying the truth of statements such as (38), deflationists merely deny that they constitute analyses of truth (cf., e.g., Horwich, 1998, p. 10). Deflationists claim that the most fundamental facts about truth are the instances of the various truth schemata used by deflationary theorists. Consider the equivalence schemata employed by Quine’s (1970) disquotationalism:

(D) ‘p’ is true iff p

and Paul Horwich’s (1998) minimalism:

(MT) The proposition that p is true iff p.

Nominalizations of descriptive items are substituted on the left-hand sides of each biconditional schema, while the right-hand sides contain either descriptive items themselves or appropriate translations of them. Each of these theorists claims that there is no more to truth than what is expressed by the substitution instances of these equivalence schemata. Truth is not analyzed as a relation and the instances of the equivalence schemata are taken to be the most fundamental facts about truth. The prosentential theory claims that each of the favored examples of these deflationary theorists is simply a special case of the more general phenomenon of anaphora. Regardless of the points of disagreement among deflationary theorists, they all agree that instances of the truth schemata represent facts about truth that are more fundamental vis-à-vis truth than any fact given in an analysis such as (38).

Some theories, such as the correspondence theory of truth, take truth to be a relation between propositions and the world. Where ‘C’ expresses the correspondence relation, ‘y’ ranges over segments of reality, and ‘x’ is used—for the sake of convenience—as a placeholder for both descriptive items and the contents of descriptive items, we can represent a common version of the correspondence theory as

(39) (x)[x is true iff (∃y)(Cxy)].

(39) should read ‘For any (descriptive item) x, x is true if and only if there is a (segment of reality) y such that x corresponds to y.’ If truth cannot be analyzed at all, then it obviously cannot be analyzed as a relation. If, however, truth can be analyzed, then perhaps it would be appropriate to analyze it as a relation between descriptive items and segments of the world. How should one go about deciding between the correspondence theory and the prosentential theory?

Prosentential theorists respond by inviting readers to consider the following facts. The correspondence theory claims that snow’s being white is necessary but not sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white.’ In addition to snow’s being white, the proposition that snow is white must stand in a relation of correspondence to the fact that snow is white. The prosentential theory, by contrast, claims that snow’s being white is both necessary and sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white.’ As Alston (1996, p. 209) puts it, “Nothing more is required for its being true that p than just the fact that p; and nothing less will suffice.” One of the hallmarks of deflationism is the claim that the truth of a descriptive item depends only upon the meaning or content expressed by that item and how things actually stand in the world. Prosentential theorists and other deflationists hope that their readers will see that further constraints on truth are unnecessary.

The prosentential theorist’s claim that no analysis of truth can be given should not be confused with the claim that no explanation of truth can be given. The prosentential theory explains the function of the truth predicate by showing how ‘x is true’ functions as a prosentence-forming operator. (Because the prosentential explanation of truth makes the story about truth depend upon a story about how we use words and concepts, the prosentential explanation of the function of “true” generally leads theorists to adopt a version of the ‘use theory of meaning.’)

Deflationary theorists also claim that truth never performs any real explanatory work. Suppose, for example, that Smith successfully performs the action of attending a concert on Friday and that his action was in part based upon his belief that the concert is on Friday. If Smith succeeds in arriving at the concert on Friday, what best explains the success of his action? The non-deflationist answers that it is the truth of Smith’s belief that explains his success. His action succeeds because his belief is true. In other words, there is an important property of his belief (or perhaps a property of the proposition expressed by his belief)—namely, truth—that is central to any adequate explanation of Smith’s successful action. Deflationists disagree. They reply that the reason that Smith succeeded in performing an action based upon the belief that the concert is on Friday is that the concert is on Friday. There is no need to implicate a special truth property in this explanation. Why do actions based upon the belief that oxygen is necessary for combustion generally succeed (other things being equal)? Because oxygen is necessary for combustion. And so on. Because prosentences never have any content of their own, whatever explanatory burden one may wish for them to shoulder will always fall to their anaphoric antecedents.

4. The Recognition-Transcendence of Truth

Unlike some alternatives to the correspondence theory (e.g., the epistemic theories of truth of C. S. Peirce, Hilary Putnam, and Michael Dummett), the prosentential theory accepts that truth can be recognition-transcendent. Epistemic theories of truth always have epistemic operators (e.g., ‘justifiably believes that…,’ ‘warrantedly asserts that…’) of some sort on the right-hand side of their analyses of truth. For example,

(CSP) p is true iff the unlimited communication community in the long run would believe that p.

(HP) p is true iff one would be warranted in asserting that p in ideal epistemic circumstances.

(IJC) p is true iff it would be justifiable to believe that p in a situation in which all relevant evidence (reasons, considerations) is readily available. (due to Alston, 1996, p. 194)

Unlike correspondence and prosentential theories, epistemic theories always mention the knowledge, assertions or justified beliefs of particular people. Subjects and their beliefs do not figure into correspondence and prosentential theories in any way.

Truth theories such as (CSP), (HP) and (IJC) have the implication that there could not be any true propositions “such that nothing that tells for or against their truth is cognitively [in]accessible to human beings, even in principle” (Alston, 1996, p. 200). Summarizing a common thread of epistemic theories of truth, Alston (1996, pp. 189-190) writes,

The truth of a truth bearer consists not in its relation to some “transcendent” state of affairs, but in the epistemic virtues the former displays within our thought, experience, and discourse. Truth value is a matter of whether, or the extent to which, a belief is justified, warranted, rational, well grounded, or the like.

According to prosentential theorists, truth theories like (CSP), (HP) and (IJC) that focus on epistemic virtues are incompatible with the various truth schemata used by deflationists to explicate the concept of truth. Schemata such as

(40) p is true iff p

represent facts about truth that are so fundamental and obvious that the uninitiated often have difficulty seeing beyond their triviality to the significance of the deflationary thesis.

According to (IJC), snow’s being white is neither necessary nor sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white’ or the proposition that snow is white. If it is possible for all relevant evidence to be readily available and yet for this evidence to be unable to make a belief that snow is white justifiable, then ‘snow is white’ will not be true—even if snow is, in fact, white. Since this seems clearly possible, snow’s being white is not sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white.’ Moreover, if it is possible for all relevant evidence to be readily available and for this evidence to make the belief that snow is white justifiable even when snow is not white, then (since this seems clearly possible) snow’s being white is not necessary for the truth of ‘snow is white’ either. Similar considerations apply to (CSP) and (HP). Prosentential theorists claim that any theory which makes snow’s being white neither necessary nor sufficient for the truth of ‘snow is white’ is inadequate. The equivalence schemata simply do not allow any room for the epistemic status of a proposition (or a belief or statement) being both necessary and sufficient for that proposition’s truth. In the eyes of prosentential theorists, epistemic theories of truth are incompatible with the equivalence schemata and their instances.

By contrast, the prosentential theory embraces the recognition-transcendence of truth. Truth schemata such as

(40) p is true iff p

do not require that anyone be able to tell whether p is the case in order for p to be true. In order for p to be true, nothing more is required than p. No one has to be able to verify or warrantedly assert it. The right-hand side of (40), then, does not limit truth to what falls within our thought, experience and discourse. As a result, the prosentential theory of truth is compatible with (though it neither entails nor is entailed by) a robustly realist metaphysics. It is a mistake to think that the correspondence theory is the only truth theory a metaphysical realist can buy into and that any critic of the correspondence theory will be an antirealist.

5. A Prosentential Theory of Falsity

The prosentential theory of truth can be extended to account for uses of the predicate ‘x is false.’ The prosentential theory of falsity will be strongly analogous to the prosentential theory of truth. The prosentential theorist can claim that, just as the predicate ‘x is true’ functions as a prosentence-forming operator, so does ‘x is false.’ When an expression referring to an antecedent utterance is substituted for ‘x’ in ‘x is true,’ the resulting claim will have the same content as its anaphoric antecedent. By parity, when a referring expression that denotes some antecedent utterance is substituted for ‘x’ in ‘x is false,’ the resulting claim will have the same content as the denial of its anaphoric antecedent. Consider the following example.

(41) Joe: The sky is cloudy. Jane: That’s true. Mark: That’s false.

Jane’s utterance has the same content as Joe’s, namely, that the sky is cloudy. Mark’s utterance, on the other hand, has the same content as the denial of Joe’s utterance, namely,

(42) The sky is not cloudy.

Mark’s utterance inherits part of its content from its anaphoric antecedent (that is, Joe’s utterance), but his utterance includes an extra bit of content not found in that antecedent: negation. Instances of the prosentence-forming operator ‘x is false,’ then, will have the same content as the negations of their antecedents.

6. The Liar Paradox

The prosentential theory of truth implies a solution to the liar paradox. Consider the following sentence.

(43) This sentence is false.

Is (43) true or false? If (43) says something true, then—since it says that (43) itself is false—it says something false. However, if (43) says something false, then—since it says that (43) is false—it says something true, namely, that (43) is false. We are thus confronted with a paradox.

Some attempts to solve the liar paradox involve extreme measures. Tarski, for example, thought that the paradox could be avoided only by eschewing ‘semantically closed languages’—i.e., languages which contain semantic terms that are applicable to sentences of that same language. He maintained that a theory of truth for a language should not be formulated within that same language. So, a theory of truth-in-L1 must be formulated in some meta-language, L2. If we allow the predicate ‘x is true-in-L1’ to be part of L1, paradoxes will result. The predicate ‘x is true-in-L1,’ then, must be part of the meta-language, L2. Since no well-formed sentence of L1 can be used to talk about the truth value of any sentence in L1, there is no chance for the liar paradox to arise because the basic liar sentence makes a claim about its own truth value. Tarski succeeds in avoiding the basic form of the liar paradox—but only at a very high price. He must content himself with providing an account of ‘true-in-Li’ rather than an account of truth. And, since natural languages like English are semantically closed, Tarski’s theory also has the weakness of applying only to artificial languages.

Defenders of the prosentential theory claim that they can provide a solution to the liar paradox that is more natural and comes with a significantly lower price tag. According to the prosentential theory, (43) is neither true nor false because it fails to pick up an anaphoric antecedent. Just as I cannot inherit my own wealth, a prosentence cannot inherit its content from itself. Anaphoric inheritance is a non-reflexive relation that holds between two distinct things. A prosentence has content only when content has been passed to it from a content-bearing antecedent. Consequently, (43) will have content only if its anaphoric antecedent does. But if (43) is its own antecedent, (43) will have content only if (43) does. Since prosentences do not have their own independent content, (43) fails to have any content. Since it does not succeed in expressing a proposition, the liar sentence is neither true nor false and the paradox is avoided.

7. Objections

Philosophical objections to the prosentential theory of truth can be divided into two main groups. One set of objections is directed against Grover, Camp and Belnap’s (1975) original version of the theory; the other is directed against Brandom’s (1994) updated version. Originally, Grover, Camp and Belnap claimed that each prosentence—e.g., ‘it is true’ or ‘that is true’—referred as a whole to an antecedent sentence token. Each occurrence of ‘it’ or ‘that’ in a prosentence, they claimed, should not be interpreted as a referring expression. In fact, ‘it,’ ‘that’ and ‘…is true’ should not be treated as having independent meanings at all. Grover, Camp and Belnap were trying to undermine the idea that the truth predicate is a property-ascribing locution. They thought that if ‘it’ and ‘that’ were taken to be referring expressions, it would seem only too natural to conclude that ‘…is true’ ascribed a predicate to their referents.

One consequence of Grover, Camp and Belnap’s commitment to the non-composite nature of prosentences is that they are forced to find non-composite prosentences in places where there do not seem to be any. Consider, for example,

(13) Goldbach’s conjecture is true


(14) ‘Snow is white’ is true.

Grover, Camp and Belnap must argue that, despite appearances, (13) and (14) are not really composed of the referring expressions ‘Goldbach’s conjecture’ and ‘’Snow is white’’ conjoined to the predicate ‘…is true.’ According to the original version of the prosentential theory, the logical form of (13) is actually something like

(13') For any sentence, if it is Goldbach’s conjecture, then it is true


(13") There is a unique sentence, such that Goldbach conjectured that it is true, and it is true.

The logical form of (14) would be either

(14') For any sentence, if it is ‘Snow is white,’ then it is true


(14") Consider: snow is white. That is true. (Grover, Camp and Belnap, p. 103)

(Each of these interpretations has been suggested by some prosentential theorist.) In three of the four interpretations, quantifiers are introduced so that the prosentence ‘it is true’ can remain an unbroken unit. Universal quantifiers are used in (13() and (14(), and an existential quantifier is used in (13").

An obvious objection to Grover, Camp and Belnap’s strategy is that it seems quite unlikely that (13') and (14') or (13") and (14") reveal the true logical structure of (13) and (14). There is no good reason to suppose that the surface structure of (13) and (14) hides genuine quantifiers below the surface. Furthermore, there are simply too many uses of the truth predicate outside of the phrases ‘it is true’ and ‘that is true’ for Grover, Camp and Belnap’s interpretation to be plausible. (Cf. Brandom (1994, pp. 303-305) and Kirkham (1992, pp. 325-329) for more critical discussion of Grover, Camp and Belnap’s early version of the prosentential theory.)

Brandom (1994, pp. 303-305) has argued that prosentential theorists do not need to treat ‘it is true’ and ‘that is true’ as non-composite units. Instead, he claims that ‘…is true’ should be treated as a prosentence-forming operator. When it is conjoined to any kind of referring expression, the resulting expression will have the same content as the antecedent sentence or utterance denoted by the referring expression. (This is the version of the prosentential theory that I have been assuming throughout.) However, a different set of problems confronts this version of the prosentential theory. Consider the following example inspired by Wilson’s (1990) criticisms of the prosentential theory.

(44) Steve: Boudreaux won the mayoral election. Kate: What that conniving, good-for-nothing bum said was true.

If Brandom’s version of the prosentential theory is correct, Kate’s utterance should have no more content than Steve’s. Clearly, however, Kate’s remark does more than simply reassert the content of Steve’s remark. It casts aspersions on Steve’s character. According to Brandom’s seemingly more defensible version of the prosentential theory, a referring expression used at the head of a prosentence serves only to pick out an antecedent from which the prosentence can inherit its content. But referring expressions can be naughty or nice, informative or dull. Once Brandom opens the door for prosentences to be formed by conjoining any referring expression to the prosentence-forming operator ‘…is true,’ it seems that he can no longer maintain that prosentences never have any more content than their anaphoric antecedents. Referring expressions are not all like proper names. Very often they bring with them a great deal more content than is strictly necessary for them to succeed in referring. A proper interpretation of prosentences cannot ignore this extra content. (Cf. Wilson (1990) for more criticisms that apply to both versions of the prosentential theory.)

8. Prosentential Theory vs. Other Deflationary Theories

According to F. P. Ramsey’s redundancy theory, one of the earliest deflationary theories, sentences such as

(45) The earth is round


(46) It is true that the earth is round

say exactly the same thing. The phrase “It is true” is a superfluous addition. Ramsey did not, however, explain why phrases like “It is true that...” or “ true” exist at all if they serve no real purpose. The prosentential theory incorporates Ramsey’s claim about redundancy of content in its account of the function of prosentences. Since prosentences inherit their content from their anaphoric antecedents, they will say the same thing as their antecedents. However, the prosentential theory goes beyond the redundancy theory by providing an explanation of why we have the truth predicate in our language. Prosentences of laziness (e.g., “That’s true” spoken after someone utters “It’s very humid in Louisiana”), it is argued, give us a way of expressing agreement without having to repeat what has been said while at the same time acknowledging that an assertion has been made. Also, quantificational prosentences (e.g., “Everything Henry Kissinger says is true”) enable us to state generalizations when we might be unable to state each individual instance of any such generalization.

The prosentential theory also tries to incorporates some of the central claims of P. F. Strawson’s performative theory of truth. According to Strawson, statements such as “That’s true” (uttered after someone says that the sun is bright) or “It is true that the sun is bright” are nonassertoric performative utterances. An utterance is nonassertoric if it does not make an assertion. Commands (e.g., “Clean your room”) are examples of nonassertoric utterances because they do not purport to state or describe any facts. Similarly, according to Strawson, “It is true” (uttered after someone says that the sun is bright) and “It is true that the sun is bright” do not assert that some sentence or proposition has the property of being true. Rather, these are performative utterances, which do not so much say something as do something. In these cases the truth predicate is being used to express agreement or to endorse some claim.

The prosentential theory follows Strawson’s performative theory in denying that the truth predicate ascribes a truth property to propositions or statements. However, the prosentential theory does not deny that prosentences—while they may very well be used to express agreement—also assert something in the act of expressing this agreement. In addition, the prosentential theory can accommodate one type of case that causes trouble for the performative theory. Many embedded uses of the truth predicate do not seem to be expressions of agreement, as in “If what he said is true, we’ll be out of this building before winter.” Such a use of the truth predicate may very well not express agreement. The speaker may be unsure whether he should endorse the claim and may be merely thinking hypothetically. The prosentential theory does not require that every use of the truth predicate be an expression of agreement—although they can be used to do so. It explains that prosentences—even those that are embedded in the antecedents of conditionals (e.g., “what he said is true”)—inherit their content from their anaphoric antecedents.

W. V. Quine’s (1970) disquotational theory of truth views the truth predicate as a convenient device of ‘semantic ascent.’ When, for example,

we want to generalize on ‘Tom is mortal or Tom is not mortal,’ ‘Snow is white or snow is not white,’ and so on, we ascend to talk of truth and of sentences, saying ‘Every sentence of the form ‘p or not p’ is true,’ or ‘Every alternation of a sentence with its negation is true.’ What prompts this semantic ascent is not that ‘Tom is mortal or Tom is not mortal’ is somehow about sentences while ‘Tom is mortal’ and ‘Tom is Tom’ are about Tom. All three are about Tom. We ascend only because of the oblique way in which the instances over which we are generalizing are related to one another. (Quine, 1970, p. 11)

The truth predicate, then, exists because it enables us to form certain generalizations that would otherwise quite difficult to state without some such device of semantic ascent. When, however, the truth predicate is used with single sentences (e.g., “‘Snow is white’ is true”), it is superfluous.

Defenders of the prosentential theory agree with Quine (1970, p. 12) that, “despite a technical ascent to talk of sentences, our eye is on the world” when we use the truth predicate. In other words, both Quine’s disquotationalism and the prosentential theory deny that the truth predicate is used to ascribe a property to propositions. The truth predicate, they claim, is used to say something about the world. The prosentential theory also acknowledges the important role the truth predicate plays in forming generalizations that might otherwise be difficult or impossible to state (cf. the discussion of quantificational prosentences above). Furthermore, both theories explain truth by explaining the role of certain linguistic items (e.g., devices of semantic ascent, prosentences) rather than focusing on language-independent propositions and properties.

However, unlike disquotationalism, the prosentential theory recognizes that there are many uses of the truth predicate in which there is nothing to disquote. For example, in the sentence “Goldbach’s conjecture is true,” there are no quotation marks to be removed. Instead of being used in connection with an entire sentence, here the truth predicate is joined to an expression (‘Goldbach’s conjecture’) referring to an antecedent sentence. It is not clear how the disquotational theory might be extended to cover this kind of case. The prosentential theory explains that any referring expression (e.g., a name, definite description, etc.) inherits its content from its anaphoric antecedent(s) and, when such an expression is conjoined to the truth predicate, a prosentence with the same content as the antecedent(s) results.

Paul Horwich’s minimalist theory of truth (1998)—unlike the prosentential theory and some other deflationary theories—takes the primary bearers of truth to be propositions rather than sentences or utterances. Horwich claims that the conjunction of all the instances of the schema

(MT) The proposition that p is true iff p

yields an implicit definition of truth. Each instance is an axiom of his theory. How many instances are there? There’s one for every possible proposition, including propositions no human being understands and maybe even a few that no human being could ever understand. In other words, there are infinitely many. Horwich claims that there is nothing more to our concept of truth than our disposition to assent to each of the instances of (MT).

Horwich and defenders of the prosentential theory agree in thinking that no analysis of truth can be given. Horwich, however, thinks that the truth predicate does expresses a property, since he believes that all predicates express properties in some minimal sense. Although the prosentential theory is typically described as denying that “true” expresses a property of any sort (see, for example, Lynch, 2001, p. 4), the writings of Dorothy Grover (1992)—the primary defender of the prosentential theory—are far from clear on the issue of predicates and properties. Grover claims that the truth predicate is not used to ascribe a property to propositions, but this is compatible with the truth predicate expressing a property in a minimal sense (à la Horwich) nonetheless. The fact that a certain Rolex is not used as a paperweight does not mean that it lacks the property of being able to weigh down papers. Grover also claims that truth is not a substantive or naturalistic property, but this claim is compatible with truth being an insubstantial or nonnaturalistic property (also à la Horwich). Since Grover does not sufficiently explain her remarks about substantive or naturalistic properties, it is difficult to tell how close her prosentential theory actually is to Horwich on this issue. Brandom’s (1994, ch. 5) discussion of the prosentential theory does not even broach the issue.

What is clear is that Horwich and defenders of the prosentential theory disagree about the virtues of the substitution interpretation of the quantifiers. Horwich recognizes that if he used substitutional quantifiers, his theory would be finitely statable. He explains, however, that substitutional quantifiers would be too costly an addition to our language: “The advantage of the truth predicate is that it allows us to say what we want without having to employ any new linguistic apparatus of this sort” (Horwich, 1998, p. 4, n. 1). Horwich also harbors doubts about whether we can spell out the notion of substitutional quantification without circularly relying upon the notion of truth (Horwich, 1998, pp. 25-26). In making this last remark, Horwich is thinking of Grover, Camp and Belnap’s unusual thesis that every use of a prosentence—even “‘Snow is white’ is true”—implicitly contains a quantifier. (Cf. section VII for more discussion of this point.) Since substitutional quantifiers must be brought in to explain every use of a prosentence, Grover, Camp and Belnap cannot explain substitutional quantification in terms of truth. However, Brandom’s (1994) version of the prosentential theory does not use substitutional quantification to explain the function of the truth predicate. He argues that, although quantificational prosentences employ substitutional quantification, lazy uses of prosentences—which are more fundamental than their quantificational cousins—do not (cf. section II above). Brandom, thus, avoids the problem of circularity.

9. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, W. P. (1996). A Realistic Conception of Truth. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Beebe, J. R. (2003). Attributive uses of prosentences. Ratio, 02/2003; 16(1), 1 - 15.
  • Belnap, Jr., N. D. (1973). Restricted quantification and conditional assertion. In H. Leblanc (Ed.), Truth, syntax and modality (pp. 48-75). Amsterdam: North Holland Publishing Co.
  • Brandom, R. B. (1994). Making it explicit: Reasoning, representing, and discursive commitment. Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press.
  • David, M. (1994). Correspondence and disquotation. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Grover, D. (1992). A prosentential theory of truth. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Grover, D., Camp, Jr., J., & Belnap, Jr., N. D. (1975). A prosentential theory of truth. Philosophical Studies, 27, 73-124.
  • Horwich, P. (1998). Truth (2nd ed.). New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Kirkham, R. L. (1992). Theories of truth: A critical introduction. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Lynch, M. P. (2001). Introduction: The mystery of truth. In M. P. Lynch (Ed.), The nature of truth: Classic and contemporary perspectives (pp. 1-6). Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Quine, W. V. (1970). Philosophy of logic. Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
  • Stich, S. P. (1990). The fragmentation of reason: Preface to a pragmatic theory of cognitive evaluation. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Wilson, W. K. (1990). Some reflections on the prosentential theory of truth. In J. M. Dunn & A. Gupta (Eds.), Truth or consequences (pp. 19-32). Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.

Author Information

James R. Beebe
Email: beebe "at" yahoo "dot" com
University at Buffalo
U. S. A.


The terms “objectivity” and “subjectivity,” in their modern usage, generally relate to a perceiving subject (normally a person) and a perceived or unperceived object. The object is something that presumably exists independent of the subject’s perception of it. In other words, the object would be there, as it is, even if no subject perceived it. Hence, objectivity is typically associated with ideas such as reality, truth and reliability.

The perceiving subject can either perceive accurately or seem to perceive features of the object that are not in the object. For example, a perceiving subject suffering from jaundice could seem to perceive an object as yellow when the object is not actually yellow. Hence, the term “subjective” typically indicates the possibility of error.

The potential for discrepancies between features of the subject’s perceptual impressions and the real qualities of the perceived object generates philosophical questions. There are also philosophical questions regarding the nature of objective reality and the nature of our so-called subjective reality. Consequently, we have various uses of the terms “objective” and “subjective” and their cognates to express possible differences between objective reality and subjective impressions. Philosophers refer to perceptual impressions themselves as being subjective or objective. Consequent judgments are objective or subjective to varying degrees, and we divide reality into objective reality and subjective reality. Thus, it is important to distinguish the various uses of the terms “objective” and “subjective.”

Table of Contents

  1. Terminology
  2. Epistemological Issues
    1. Can We Know Objective Reality?
    2. Does Agreement Among Subjects Indicate Objective Knowledge?
    3. Primary and Secondary Qualities: Can We Know Primary Qualities?
    4. Skepticism Regarding Knowledge of Objective Reality
    5. Defending Objective Knowledge
    6. Is There No Escape From the Subjective?
  3. Metaphysical Issues
  4. Objectivity in Ethics
    1. Persons in Contrast to Objects
    2. Objectivism, Subjectivism and Non-Cognitivism
    3. Objectivist Theories
    4. Can We Know Moral Facts?
  5. Major Historical Philosophical Theories of Objective Reality
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Terminology

Many philosophers would use the term “objective reality” to refer to anything that exists as it is independent of any conscious awareness of it (via perception, thought, etc.). Common mid-sized physical objects presumably apply, as do persons having subjective states. Subjective reality would then include anything depending upon some (broadly construed) conscious awareness of it to exist. Particular instances of colors and sounds (as they are perceived) are prime examples of things that exist only when there are appropriate conscious states. Particular instances of emotions (e.g., my present happiness) also seem to be a subjective reality, existing when one feels them, and ceasing to exist when one’s mood changes.

“Objective knowledge” can simply refer to knowledge of an objective reality. Subjective knowledge would then be knowledge of any subjective reality.

There are, however, other uses of the terminology related to objectivity. Many philosophers use the term “subjective knowledge” to refer only to knowledge of one’s own subjective states. Such knowledge is distinguished from one’s knowledge of another individual’s subjective states and from knowledge of objective reality, which would both be objective knowledge under the present definitions. Your knowledge of another person’s subjective states can be called objective knowledge since it is presumably part of the world that is “object” for you, just as you and your subjective states are part of the world that is “object” for the other person.

This is a prominent distinction in epistemology (the philosophical study of knowledge) because many philosophers have maintained that subjective knowledge in this sense has a special status. They assert, roughly, that knowledge of one’s own subjective states is direct, or immediate, in a way that knowledge of anything else is not. It is convenient to refer to knowledge of one’s own subjective states simply as subjective knowledge. Following this definition, objective knowledge would be knowledge of anything other than one’s own subjective states.

One last prominent style of usage for terms related to objectivity deals with the nature of support a particular knowledge-claim has. “Objective knowledge” can designate a knowledge-claim having, roughly, the status of being fully supported or proven. Correspondingly, “subjective knowledge” might designate some unsupported or weakly supported knowledge-claim. It is more accurate to refer to these as objective and subjective judgments, rather than knowledge, but one should be on guard for the use of the term “knowledge” in this context. This usage fits with the general connotation for the term “objectivity” of solidity, trustworthiness, accuracy, impartiality, etc. The general connotation for many uses of “subjectivity” includes unreliability, bias, an incomplete (personal) perspective, etc.

“Objective judgment or belief” refers to a judgment or belief based on objectively strong supporting evidence, the sort of evidence that would be compelling for any rational being. A subjective judgment would then seem to be a judgment or belief supported by evidence that is compelling for some rational beings (subjects) but not compelling for others. It could also refer to a judgment based on evidence that is of necessity available only to some subjects.

These are the main uses for the terminology within philosophical discussions. Let’s examine some of the main epistemological issues regarding objectivity, presuming the aforementioned definitions of “objective reality” and “subjective reality.”

2. Epistemological Issues

a. Can We Know Objective Reality?

The subjective is characterized primarily by perceiving mind. The objective is characterized primarily by physical extension in space and time. The simplest sort of discrepancy between subjective judgment and objective reality is well illustrated by John Locke’s example of holding one hand in ice water and the other hand in hot water for a few moments. When one places both hands into a bucket of tepid water, one experiences competing subjective experiences of one and the same objective reality. One hand feels it as cold, the other feels it as hot. Thus, one perceiving mind can hold side-by-side clearly differing impressions of a single object. From this experience, it seems to follow that two different perceiving minds could have clearly differing impressions of a single object. That is, two people could put their hands into the bucket of water, one describing it as cold, the other describing it as hot. Or, more plausibly, two people could step outside, one describing the weather as chilly, the other describing it as pleasant.

We confront, then, an epistemological challenge to explain whether, and if so how, some subjective impressions can lead to knowledge of objective reality. A skeptic can contend that our knowledge is limited to the realm of our own subjective impressions, allowing us no knowledge of objective reality as it is in itself.

b. Does Agreement Among Subjects Indicate Objective Knowledge?

Measurement is allegedly a means to reach objective judgments, judgments having at least a high probability of expressing truth regarding objective reality. An objective judgment regarding the weather, in contrast to the competing subjective descriptions, would describe it as, say, 20°C (68°F). This judgment results from use of a measuring device. It is unlikely that the two perceiving subjects, using functioning thermometers, would have differing judgments about the outside air.

The example of two people giving differing reports about the weather (e.g., “chilly” vs. “pleasant”) illustrates that variation in different subjects’ judgments is a possible indicator of the subjectivity of their judgments. Agreement in different subjects’ judgments (20°C) is often taken to be indicative of objectivity. Philosophers commonly call this form of agreement “intersubjective agreement.” Does intersubjective agreement prove that there is objective truth? No, because having two or three or more perceiving subjects agreeing, for example, that it is very cold does not preclude the possibility of another perceiving subject claiming that it is not at all cold. Would we have a high likelihood of objective truth if we had intersubjective agreement among a large number of subjects? This line of reasoning seems promising, except for another observation from Locke about the possible discrepancies between subjective impressions and objective reality.

c. Primary and Secondary Qualities: Can We Know Primary Qualities?

According to Locke’s distinction between primary and secondary qualities, some of our subjective impressions do not correspond to any objective reality in the thing perceived. Our perception of sound, for example, is nothing like the actual physical vibrations that we know are the real cause of our subjective experience. Our perception of color is nothing like the complex combinations of various frequencies of electromagnetic radiation that we know cause our perception of color. Locke asserts that we can, through science, come to know what primary characteristics the object has in itself. Science teaches us, he says, that sound as we perceive it is not in the object itself whereas spatial dimensions, mass, duration, motion, etc. are in the object itself.

In response to this point, one can assert that, through science, we discover that those subjective impressions corresponding to nothing in the object are nonetheless caused by the truly objective features of the object. Thus, Locke’s approach leads to optimism regarding objective knowledge, i.e., knowledge of how things are independent of our perceptions of them.

d. Skepticism Regarding Knowledge of Objective Reality

In response to Locke’s line of thinking, Immanuel Kant used the expression “Ding an sich” (the “thing-in-itself”) to designate pure objectivity. The Ding an sich is the object as it is in itself, independent of the features of any subjective perception of it. While Locke was optimistic about scientific knowledge of the true objective (primary) characteristics of things, Kant, influenced by skeptical arguments from David Hume, asserted that we can know nothing regarding the true nature of the Ding an sich, other than that it exists. Scientific knowledge, according to Kant, is systematic knowledge of the nature of things as they appear to us subjects rather than as they are in themselves.

Using Kant’s distinction, intersubjective agreement would seem to be not only the best evidence we can have of objective truth but constitutive of objective truth itself. (This might require a theoretically perfect intersubjective agreement under ideal conditions.) Starting from the assumption that we can have knowledge only of things as they appear in subjective experience, the only plausible sense for the term “objective” would be judgments for which there is universal intersubjective agreement, or just for which there is necessarily universal agreement. If, alternately, we decide to restrict the term “objective” to the Ding an sich, there would be, according to Kant, no objective knowledge. The notion of objectivity thus becomes useless, perhaps even meaningless (for, say, a verificationist).

Facing any brand of skepticism regarding knowledge of objective reality in any robust sense, we should note that the notion of there being an objective reality is independent of any particular assertion about our prospects for knowing that reality in any objective sense. One should, in other words, agree that the idea of some objective reality, existing as it is independent of any subjective perception of it, apparently makes sense even for one who holds little hope for any of us knowing that there is such a reality, or knowing anything objectively about such a reality. Perhaps our human situation is such that we cannot know anything beyond our experiences; perhaps we are, each one of us individually, confined to the theater of our own minds. Nonetheless, we can conceive what it means to assert an objective reality beyond the stream of our experiences.

e. Defending Objective Knowledge

Opposing skepticism regarding objective reality, it is conceivable that there are “markers” of some sort in our subjective experiences distinguishing the reliable perceptions of objective truth from the illusions generated purely subjectively (hallucinations, misperceptions, perceptions of secondary qualities, etc.). Descartes, for example, wrote of “clear and distinct impressions” as having an inherent mark, as it were, attesting to their reliability as indicators of how things are objectively. This idea does not have many defenders today, however, since Descartes asserted certainty for knowledge derived from clear and distinct ideas. More acceptable among philosophers today would be a more modest assertion of a high likelihood of reliability for subjective impressions bearing certain marks. The marks of reliable impressions are not “clear and distinct” in Descartes’ sense, but have some connection to common sense ideas about optimal perceptual circumstances. Thus, defenders of objective knowledge are well advised to search for subjectively accessible “marks” on impressions that indicate a high likelihood of truth.

A defender of the prospects for objective knowledge would apparently want also to give some significance to intersubjective agreement. Assertions of intersubjective agreement are based, of course, on one’s subjective impressions of other perceiving subjects agreeing with one’s own judgments. Thus, intersubjective agreement is just one type of “mark” one might use to identify the more likely reliable impressions. This is simple common-sense. We have much more confidence in our judgments (or should, anyway) when they are shared by virtually everyone with whom we discuss them than when others (showing every sign of normal perceptual abilities and a sane mind) disagree. A central assumption behind this common pattern of thought, however, is that there are indeed many other perceiving subjects besides ourselves and we are all capable, sometimes at least, of knowing objective reality. Another assumption is that objective reality is logically consistent. Assuming that reality is consistent, it follows that your and my logically incompatible judgments about a thing cannot both be true; intersubjective disagreement indicates error for at least one of us. One can also argue that agreement indicates probable truth, because it is unlikely that you and I would both be wrong in our judgment regarding an object and both be wrong in exactly the same way. Conversely, if we were both wrong about some object, it is likely that we would have differing incorrect judgments about it, since there are innumerable ways for us to make a wrong judgment about an object.

f. Is There No Escape From the Subjective?

Despite plausible ways of arguing that intersubjective disagreement indicates error and agreement indicates some probability of truth, defenses of objective knowledge all face the philosophically daunting challenge of providing a cogent argument showing that any purported “mark” of reliability (including apparent intersubjective agreement) actually does confer a high likelihood of truth. The task seems to presuppose some method of determining objective truth in the very process of establishing certain sorts of subjective impressions as reliable indicators of truth. That is, we require some independent (non-subjective) way of determining which subjective impressions support knowledge of objective reality before we can find subjectively accessible “markers” of the reliable subjective impressions. What could such a method be, since every method of knowledge, judgment, or even thought seems quite clearly to go on within the realm of subjective impressions? One cannot get out of one’s subjective impressions, it seems, to test them for reliability. The prospects for knowledge of the objective world are hampered by our essential confinement within subjective impressions.

3. Metaphysical Issues

In metaphysics, i.e., the philosophical study of the nature of reality, the topic of objectivity brings up philosophical puzzles regarding the nature of the self, for a perceiving subject is also, according to most metaphysical theories, a potential object of someone else’s perceptions. Further, one can perceive oneself as an object, in addition to knowing one’s subjective states fairly directly. The self, then, is known both as subject and as object. Knowledge of self as subject seems to differ significantly from knowledge of the self as object.

The differences are most markedly in evidence in the philosophy of mind. Philosophers of mind try to reconcile, in some sense, what we know about the mind objectively and what we know subjectively. Observing minded beings as objects is central to the methods of psychology, sociology, and the sciences of the brain. Observing one minded being from the subjective point of view is something we all do, and it is central to our ordinary notions of the nature of mind. A fundamental problem for the philosophy of mind is to explain how any object, no matter how complex, can give rise to mind as we know it from the subjective point of view. That is, how can mere “stuff” give rise to the rich complexity of consciousness as we experience it? It seems quite conceivable that there be creatures exactly like us, when seen as objects, but having nothing like our conscious sense of ourselves as subjects. So there is the question of why we do have subjective conscious experience and how that comes to be. Philosophers also struggle to explain what sort of relationship might obtain between mind as we see it embodied objectively and mind as we experience it subjectively. Are there cause-and-effect relationships, for example, and how do they work?

The topic of seeing others and even oneself as an object in the objective world is a metaphysical issue, but it brings up an ethical issue regarding the treatment of persons. There are, in addition, special philosophical issues regarding assertions of objectivity in ethics.

4. Objectivity in Ethics

a. Persons in Contrast to Objects

First, the dual nature of persons as both subjects (having subjective experience) and objects within objective reality relates to one of the paramount theories of ethics in the history of philosophy. Immanuel Kant’s ethics gives a place of central importance to respect for persons. One formulation of his highly influential Categorical Imperative relates to the dual nature of persons. This version demands that one “treat humanity, in your own person or in the person of any other, never simply as a means, but always at the same time as an end” (Groundwork, p. 96). One may treat a mere object simply as a means to an end; one may use a piece of wood, for example, simply as a means of repairing a fence. A person, by contrast, is marked by subjectivity, having a subjective point of view, and has a special moral status according to Kant. Every person must be regarded as an end, that is as having intrinsic value. It seems that the inherent value of a person depends essentially on the fact that a person has a subjective conscious life in addition to objective existence.

This ethical distinction brings out an aspect of the term “object” as a “mere object,” in contrast to the subjectivity of a person. The term “objectivity” in this context can signify the mere “object-ness” of something at its moral status.

Despite widespread agreement that being a person with a subjective point of view has a special moral status, there is a general difficulty explaining whether this alleged fact, like all alleged moral facts, is an objective fact in any sense. It is also difficult to explain how one can know moral truths if they are indeed objective.

b. Objectivism, Subjectivism and Non-Cognitivism

Philosophical theories about the nature of morality generally divide into assertions that moral truths express subjective states and assertions that moral truths express objective facts, analogous to the fact, for example, that the sun is more massive than the earth.

So-called subjectivist theories regard moral statements as declaring that certain facts hold, but the facts expressed are facts about a person’s subjective states. For example, the statement “It is wrong to ignore a person in distress if you are able to offer aid” just means something like “I find it offensive when someone ignores a person in distress….” This is a statement about the subject’s perceptions of the object, not about the object itself (that is, ignoring a person in distress). Objectivist theories, in contrast, regard the statement “It is wrong to ignore….” as stating a fact about the ignoring itself.

Subjectivist theories do not have to regard moral statements as statements about a single subject’s perceptions or feelings. A subjectivist could regard the statement “Torture is immoral,” for example, as merely expressing the feeling of abhorrence among members of a certain culture, or among people in general.

In addition to objectivism and subjectivism, a third major theory of morality called non-cognitivism asserts that alleged moral statements do not make any claim about any reality, either subjective or objective. This approach asserts that alleged moral statements are just expressions of subjective feelings; they are not reports about such feelings. Thus the statement “Torture is immoral” is equivalent to wincing or saying “ugh” at the thought of torture, rather than describing your feelings about torture.

c. Objectivist Theories

Among objectivist theories of morality, the most straightforward version declares that is it an objective fact, for example, that it is wrong to ignore a person in distress if you are able to offer aid. This sort of theory asserts that the wrongness of such behavior is part of objective reality in the same way that the sun’s being more massive than the earth is part of objective reality. Both facts would obtain regardless of whether any conscious being ever came to know either of them.

Other objectivist theories of morality try to explain the widespread feeling that there is an important difference between moral assertions and descriptive, factual assertions while maintaining that both types of assertion are about something other than mere subjective states. Such theories compare moral assertions to assertions about secondary qualities. The declaration that a certain object is green is not merely a statement about a person’s subjective state. It makes an assertion about how the object is, but it’s an assertion that can be formulated only in relation to the states of perceiving subjects under the right conditions. Thus, determining whether an object is green depends essentially on consulting the considered judgments of appropriately placed perceivers. Being green, by definition, implies the capacity to affect perceiving humans under the right conditions in certain ways. By analogy, moral assertions can be assertions about how things objectively are while depending essentially on consulting the considered judgments of appropriately placed perceivers. Being morally wrong implies, on this view, the capacity to affect perceiving humans under the right conditions in certain ways.

d. Can We Know Moral Facts?

For either sort of objectivist approach to morality, it is difficult to explain how people come to know the moral properties of things. We seem not to be able to know the moral qualities of things through ordinary sense experience, for example, because the five senses seem only to tell us how things are in the world, not how they ought to be. Nor can we reason from the way things are to the way they ought to be, since, as David Hume noted, “is” does not logically imply an “ought.” Some philosophers, including Hume, have postulated that we have a special mode of moral perception, analogous to but beyond the five ordinary senses, which gives us knowledge of moral facts. This proposal is controversial, since it presents problems for verifying moral perceptions and resolving moral disputes. It is also problematic as long as it provides no account of how moral perception works. By contrast, we have a good understanding of the mechanisms underlying our perception of secondary qualities such as greenness.

Many people assert that it is much less common to get widespread agreement on moral judgments than on matters of observable, measurable facts. Such an assertion seems to be an attempt to argue that moral judgments are not objective based on lack of intersubjective agreement about them. Widespread disagreement does not, however, indicate that there is no objective fact to be known. There are many examples of widespread disagreement regarding facts that are clearly objective. For example, there was once widespread disagreement about whether the universe is expanding or in a “steady state.” That disagreement did not indicate that there is no objective fact concerning the state of the universe. Thus, widespread disagreement regarding moral judgments would not, by itself, indicate that there are no objective moral facts.

This assertion is apparently an attempt to modify the inference from widespread intersubjective agreement to objective truth. If so, it is mistaken. Assuming that the inference from intersubjective agreement to probable objective truth is strong, it does not follow that one can infer from lack of intersubjective agreement to probable subjectivity. As previously indicated, intersubjective disagreement logically supports the assertion that there is an error in at least one of the conflicting judgments, but it does not support an assertion of the mere subjectivity of the matter being judged. Further, the vast areas of near-universal agreement in moral judgments typically receives too little attention in discussions of the nature of morality. There are seemingly innumerable moral judgments (e.g., it is wrong to needlessly inflict pain on a newborn baby) that enjoy nearly universal agreement across cultures and across time periods. This agreement should, at least prima facie, support an assertion to objectivity as it does for, say, judgments about the temperature outside.

5. Major Historical Philosophical Theories of Objective Reality

Any serious study of the nature of objectivity and objective knowledge should examine the central metaphysical and epistemological positions of history’s leading philosophers, as well as contemporary contributions. The following very brief survey should give readers some idea of where to get started.

Plato is famous for a distinctive view of objective reality. He asserted roughly that the greatest reality was not in the ordinary physical objects we sense around us, but in what he calls Forms, or Ideas. (The Greek term Plato uses resembles the word “idea,” but it is preferable to call them Forms, for they are not ideas that exist only in a mind, as is suggested in our modern usage of the term “idea.”) Ordinary objects of our sense experience are real, but the Forms are a “higher reality,” according to Plato. Having the greatest reality, they are the only truly objective reality, we could say.

Forms are most simply described as the pure essences of things, or the defining characteristics of things. We see many varied instances of chairs around us, but the essence of what it is to be a chair is the Form “chair.” Likewise, we see many beautiful things around us, but the Form “beauty” is the “what it is to be beautiful.” The Form is simply whatever it is that sets beautiful things apart from everything else.

In epistemology, Plato accordingly distinguishes the highest knowledge as knowledge of the highest reality, the Forms. Our modern usage of the terms “objective knowledge” and “objective reality” seem to fit in reasonably well here.

Aristotle, by contrast, identifies the ordinary objects of sense experience as the most objective reality. He calls them “primary substance.” The forms of things he calls “secondary substance.” Hence, Aristotle’s metaphysics seems to fit better than Plato’s with our current understanding of objective reality, but his view of objective knowledge differs somewhat. For him, objective knowledge is knowledge of the forms, or essences, of things. We can know individual things objectively, but not perfectly. We can know individuals only during occurrent perceptual contact with them, but we can know forms perfectly, or timelessly.

Descartes famously emphasized that subjective reality is better known than objective reality, but knowledge of the objective reality of one’s own existence as a non-physical thinking thing is nearly as basic, or perhaps as basic, as one’s knowledge of the subjective reality of one’s own thinking. For Descartes, knowledge seems to start with immediate, indubitable knowledge of one’s subjective states and proceeds to knowledge of one’s objective existence as a thinking thing. Cogito, ergo sum (usually translated as “I think, therefore I am”) expresses this knowledge. All knowledge of realities other than oneself ultimately rests on this immediate knowledge of one’s own existence as a thinking thing. One’s existence as a non-physical thinking thing is an objective existence, but it appears that Descartes infers this existence from the subjective reality of his own thinking. The exact interpretation of his famous saying is still a matter of some controversy, however, and it may not express an inference at all.

We have already looked at some of John Locke’s most influential assertions about the nature of objective reality. Bishop Berkeley followed Locke’s empiricism in epistemology, but put forth a markedly different view of reality. Berkeley’s Idealism asserts that the only realities are minds and mental contents. He does, however, have a concept of objective reality. A table, for example, exists objectively in the mind of God. God creates objective reality by thinking it and sustains any objective reality, such as the table, only so long as he continues to think of it. Thus the table exists objectively for us, not just as a fleeting perception, but as the totality of all possible experiences of it. My particular experience of it at this moment is a subjective reality, but the table as an objective reality in the mind of God implies a totality of all possible experiences of it. Berkeley asserts there is no need to postulate some physical substance underlying all those experiences to be the objective reality of the table; the totality of possible experiences is adequate.

We have looked briefly at some of Kant’s claims about the nature of objective reality. More recent philosophy continues these discussions in many directions, some denying objectivity altogether. Detailed discussion of these movements goes beyond the purview of this essay, but interested readers should specially investigate Hegel’s idealism, as well as succeeding schools of thought such as phenomenology, existentialism, logical positivism, pragmatism, deconstructionism, and post-modernism. The philosophy of mind, naturally, also continually confronts basic questions of subjectivity and objectivity.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, William P. “Yes, Virginia, There is a Real World.” Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 52 (1979): 779-808.
  • Descartes, Rene. Meditations (1641). In The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, eds. J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff and D. Murdoch (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975).
  • Kant, Immanuel. Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics (1783). Trans. James W. Ellington (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1977).
  • Locke, John. Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1689). Ed. Peter Nidditch (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975).
  • Moser, Paul. Philosophy After Objectivity. (New York: Oxford University Press, 1993).
  • Nagel, Thomas. The View From Nowhere. (New York: Oxford University Press, 1986).
  • Quine, W. V. Word and Object. (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1960).
  • Rorty, Richard. Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979).
  • Rorty, Richard. Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Vol. 1. (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991).
  • Wright, Crispin. Realism, Meaning, and Truth. (Oxford: Blackwell, 1987).

Author Information

Dwayne H. Mulder
Sonoma State University
U. S. A.


Evidentialism in epistemology is defined by the following thesis about epistemic justification:

(EVI) Person S is justified in believing proposition p at time t if and only if S’s evidence for p at t supports believing p.

As evidentialism is a thesis about epistemic justification, it is a thesis about what it takes for one to believe justifiably, or reasonably, in the sense thought to be necessary for knowledge. Particular versions of evidentialism can diverge in virtue of their providing different claims about what sorts of things count as evidence, what it is for one to have evidence, and what it is for one’s evidence to support believing a proposition. Thus, while (EVI) is often referred to as the theory of epistemic justification known as evidentialism, it is more accurately conceived as a kind of epistemic theory. In this light, (EVI) can be seen as the central, guiding thesis of evidentialism. All evidentialist theories conform to (EVI), but various divergent theories of evidentialism can be formulated.

Before turning to these issues, it is worth noting that evidentialism is also a prominent theory in the philosophy of religion. Evidentialism in the philosophy of religion has its own set of controversies, but this entry will not cover them. On evidentialism in the philosophy of religion, see Alvin Plantinga’s classic article, “Reason and Belief in God.” For a more extended discussion, see Plantinga’s Warranted Christian Belief.

Table of Contents

  1. A Brief Prima Facie Case
  2. Developing the Theory
    1. The Justification of Propositions v. The Justification of Beliefs
    2. Evidence
    3. Having Evidence
    4. Support
  3. Objections
    1. Forgotten Evidence
    2. Against a Probabilistic-Deductive Understanding of Support
    3. Essential Appeals to Deontology
      1. Ought Implies Can
      2. An Evidence-Gathering Requirement
      3. Duties Not to Follow One’s Evidence
    4. A Pragmatic Reply
    5. Rationally Believing Skepticism is False
  4. Conclusion
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. More Advanced Studies

1. A Brief Prima Facie Case

When we think about what it takes for one to believe reasonably or justifiably, we think that one has to have good reasons (or, more accurately, adequate reason for thinking the proposition in question is true). We think that one is not believing as one should when one believes something for no reason whatsoever or for very weak reasons. This dependence on reasons seems to be central to the very concept of justified belief. It should be no surprise, then, that the traditional view holds that one is justified only if one has adequate reasons for belief. Thus, evidentialism can be thought of as the default, or commonsense, conception of epistemic justification. Indeed, we can see the centrality of this conception of justification throughout the history of philosophy, especially in its grappling with the problem of skepticism. In order to justify denying skeptical claims, we want to know what reason we have for believing that skepticism is false. Traditional accounts have looked to one’s available evidence or reasons for an answer.

Naturally, then, we see this traditional conception reflected in the writings of many influential philosophers. David Hume, for example, writes that the “wise man. . . proportions his belief to the evidence,” and he proceeds with this as his epistemic ideal (73). Bertrand Russell endorses the view that “[p]erfect rationality consists . . . in attaching to every proposition a degree of belief corresponding to its degree of credibility,” credibility functionally depending on evidence (397-398). W.K. Clifford writes that “it is wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone to believe anything upon insufficient evidence” (518). Such quotations help to illustrate the dominance of the view that justified belief depends upon one’s having good reasons or evidence. Though this by no means settles the issue, it does provide reason to try to work out a theory of justification that appeals solely to evidence. The remainder of this entry turns toward a detailed consideration of the theory itself.

2. Developing the Theory

Richard Feldman and Earl Conee, two leading defenders of evidentialism, have explicitly defined evidentialism as a thesis about the justificatory status of all of the doxastic attitudes: belief, disbelief, and suspension of judgment. They write that doxastic attitude, d, toward p is justified for one at t if and only if one’s evidence at t supports one’s taking d towards p (15). So understood, evidentialism is not just a thesis about justified belief, it is also a thesis about justified disbelief and the justified withholding of belief. Only one doxastic attitude towards a proposition is justified for a person at a time, and this is a function of one’s evidence. Here, I focus on the core of evidentialism—the thesis about justified belief given in (EVI)—both for simplicity and because most treatments and criticisms of evidentialism focus on it. What is said about (EVI) can be extended naturally to the rest of the doxastic attitudes and thereby applied to Feldman and Conee’s explicit thesis.

a. The Justification of Propositions v. The Justification of Beliefs

Before proceeding, it is crucial to nail down more exactly what evidentialism is a theory of. As I have defined it in (EVI), evidentialism is the thesis that one is justified in believing a proposition at a time if and only if one’s evidence at that time supports believing that proposition. (EVI) does not entail that whenever one has adequate evidence for p one believes p justifiably. This is for two reasons. First, one can be justified in believing p even if one fails to believe it. For example, one might not believe p simply because one fails to consider whether or not p is true, yet one may nevertheless have good enough reason to think p is true and so be justified in believing p.

Second, one can have good enough reason to believe p and still believe it as a result of something other than this good reason. One might believe it as a result of wishful thinking, for example. In such a case, the evidentialist holds that the person is justified in believing the proposition in question but, nevertheless, believes it unjustifiably. One believes it for or because of the wrong reasons. One way of putting the difference here is by saying that evidentialism is a thesis regarding propositional justification, not a thesis about doxastic justification. That is, evidentialism is a thesis about when one is justified in believing a proposition, not a thesis about when one’s believing is justified. The latter requires not just that one have good reason to believe but also that one believe for those good reasons.

b. Evidence

As introduced above, evidentialism is a kind of theory of epistemic justification; one can formulate various divergent evidentialist theories by providing different analyses of its constituent concepts. The present section focuses on the central notion of evidence and explicates the various ways that one can restrict the sorts of things that count as evidence. Sections 2c. and 2d. turn to complexities in other parts of (EVI). Together, these three sections illustrate the diversity of possible evidentialist theories.

Evidence for or against p is, roughly, any information relevant to the truth or falsity of p. This is why we think that fingerprints and DNA left at the scene of the crime, eye-witness testimony, and someone’s whereabouts at the time the crime was committed all count as evidence for or against the hypothesis that the suspect committed the crime. The sort of evidence that interests the evidentialist, however, is not just anything whatsoever that is relevant to the truth of the proposition in question. The evidentialist denies that such facts about mind-independent reality are evidence in the sense relevant to determining justification. According to (EVI) only facts that one has are relevant to determining what one is justified in believing, and in order for one to have something in the relevant sense, one has to be aware of, to know about, or to, in some sense, “mentally possess” it. The sort of evidence the evidentialist is interested in, therefore, is restricted to mental entities (or, roughly, to mental “information”). In addition, it is only one’s own mental information that is relevant to determining whether one is justified in believing that p. For example, my belief that Jones was in Buffalo at the time the crime was committed is not relevant to determining whether you are justified in believing that Jones committed the crime.

Evidentialist theories can agree on this much while still providing differing accounts of evidence. For example, one might think that only one’s own beliefs can provide one with reason to believe something, as many coherentists do. An evidentialist might then hold that only belief states are evidential states. One’s experiences (that is, experiential states) then would not be evidentially or justificatorily relevant. The standard view of evidentialism, however, is that at least beliefs and perceptual states are evidential states. Not only what you believe but also what you experience can provide you with reason to believe that something is the case. Yet one does not have to stop there. One, for example, might also count memories, apparent memories, or seemings-to-be-true as kinds of evidence. In the end, what sorts of states one takes to be evidential will depend both on one’s intuitions about what sorts of things can provide one with genuine reason to believe and also on one’s strategy for responding to objections.

It is worth noting that while evidentialists have available many options about what to count as kinds of evidence, not just anything mental can properly be classified as evidence. In general, only those states or properties that are themselves informational (or at least can directly and on their own “communicate” information to the subject) can properly be classified as evidential states or properties. Regardless of whether one’s feeling of pain is an informational state, it does, so to speak, directly or on its own “communicate” information to one; so it is open to the evidentialist to classify it as an evidential state. By contrast, one’s ability to, e.g., identify complex geometrical shapes in one’s visual field is not itself a kind of evidence. (Even though this ability will undoubtedly provide one with evidence one would otherwise not possess.) The ability to identify complex geometrical shapes in one’s visual field is not a kind of evidence because it is neither an informational state, nor is it a state that directly and on its own “communicates” information to one. Instead, it is always something else that gets “communicated” to one via that ability. In general, therefore, cognitive abilities are not properly considered as part of one’s evidence. As we will see below, though, this is not to say that one’s cognitive abilities are completely irrelevant to justification on every evidentialist view.

c. Having Evidence

As alluded to above, not just any evidence whatsoever is relevant to determining whether one’s belief is justified; it is only the evidence that one has that is so relevant. The obvious restriction this imposes is that one’s evidence includes only one’s own mental states. One option, then, is to hold that one’s evidence at a time (or, alternatively, the evidence one has at a time) consists in all of the evidential mental states that obtain in the person at that time, including both occurrent and nonoccurrent mental states. On this view, one’s evidence includes not only one’s present experiences and those beliefs presently “before one’s mind” but also stored or standing beliefs, even if one is not presently able to recall or consciously consider them.

To see how this account of having evidence affects the consequences of the theory, consider the following example. Suppose that I believe that most television newscasters reliably report the day’s news. I find that television newscasters almost always report the day’s stories in ways consistent with that reported by other news outlets. For example, if the newscaster were to report that a fire occurred on Elm Street, I would also be able to find a report in the newspaper confirming that a fire did, indeed, occur on Elm Street. When I discuss this topic with people, they tend to agree that this is the case, and I have no strong evidence against this belief. It seems, then, that I justifiably believe that most television newscasters reliably report the news. Also suppose that fifteen years ago I heard reliable testimony that one newscaster, Mick Stuppagin, almost always provides incorrect reports. At the time, I believed that Mick was a very unreliable newscaster. Suppose, however, that although my belief that Mick’s reports are unreliable and the testimony that such is the case are still stored in my long-term memory, I am presently unable to recall them. If someone mentions Mick Stuppagin and asks whether I think he is a reliable newscaster, I may form the belief that he is a reliable newscaster on the basis of my justified belief that most newscasters are reliable.

On the view developed above, I would be believing unjustifiably, since I have outweighing evidence against p. I would not be justified in believing that Mick is a reliable newscaster even though I may be utterly unable to recall my evidence against this belief, even though my so believing may be completely blameless, and even though it may seem to me on deep reflection that I am believing as I should. Some may find this counterintuitive and, as a result, may want to formulate a more restricted account of having evidence.

One such option is to hold that the evidence one has at a time is restricted to one’s occurrent evidential states—i.e., those states involving one’s current assent, those presently “before one’s mind,” so to speak. On this account of having evidence, my stored memory belief that Mick Stuppagin is an unreliable newscaster is not evidence that I have at the present time. Furthermore, it is also not clearly true that I have as evidence my belief that most television newscasters reliably report the day’s news, and it is doubtful that my testimonial and inductive evidence for this belief is properly considered evidence that I presently have. The justificatory status of my present belief about Mick Stuppagin will depend solely on my occurrent evidential states. (The details of the case would need to be filled in order to determine whether or not the theory implies that belief is justified.)

The difficulty for this view is to show how such a restricted view of one’s having evidence can account for the justification of all of the beliefs we think are justified. For instance, we think we have some non-occurrent beliefs that are justified. We need an explanation of this. Similarly, it seems that as soon as I occurrently entertain the proposition that George Washington was the first president of the United States, I am justified in believing it, and its being so justified does not depend upon my consciously recalling anything. Those who restrict the evidence one has to one’s occurrent states need either to provide an explanation of this or to in some way explain away these common intuitions.

Other accounts of having evidence lie between these two extremes. A more typical “internalist” account might hold, for example, that the evidence one has at a time is that which is easily available to one upon reflection, so not all of one’s beliefs count as evidence that one has at a time. On this account, I am presently justified in believing that Mick is a reliable newscaster if and only if my stored memory belief that Mick is an unreliable newscaster (and its supporting evidence) is not easily available to me upon reflection. Various other accounts of having evidence can be developed that allow for varying degrees of availability or varying amounts of reflection. Guiding each account of having evidence are intuitions regarding cases similar to that above and intuitions regarding the extent to which justification is deontological.

We can conclude from the above that evidentialist theories can be formulated so as to account for widely divergent intuitions regarding cases. Furthermore, without a specific account of what it is for one to have evidence, it is not clear which proposed cases are to count as counterexamples to the theory.

d. Support

Recall that on the evidentialist view, S is justified in believing p at t if and only if S’s evidence for p at t supports believing p. We have already seen how evidentialists can provide different accounts of evidence and having evidence. The present section focuses on complexities with the notion of support.

Perhaps the most obvious issue that needs to be addressed in order to understand what it is for one’s evidence to support believing a proposition is the degree to which one’s evidence must support that proposition in order for one to be justified in believing it. Again, this will vary from account to account. One standard account understands it as follows: one is justified in believing a proposition only if the evidence that one has makes it more likely to be true than not. The likelihood of truth given one’s evidence has to be greater than 0.5 in order for one to be justified in believing the proposition, but the threshold required for knowledge might be much higher. In order to know that p, one might not merely have to justifiably believe that p; one might have to justifiably believe it to a certain degree.

This way of understanding the degree of support required in order for one to be justified in believing p is absolute, or we might say non-contextual. The degree required is the same across all possible cases. By contrast, Stewart Cohen presents a contextualist version of evidentialism. On his account, the degree to which one’s evidence must support a proposition in order for one to be justified in believing it will fluctuate with the conversationally determined standards that govern attributions of justification and knowledge. An immediate result is that one’s evidence for p may be enough to make believing p justified in one context (where the conversationally-determined standards for justification are relatively low) while failing to make believing p justified in another context (where the standards for justification are much higher). Evidentialism is, therefore, consistent with both contextualist theories of justification and non-contextualist theories of justification.

A further, more central epistemological issue regarding support has to do with the structure of justification. Evidentialism may be combined with foundationalism, coherentism, a “mixed” view such as Susan Haack’s foundherentism, or any other theory of the structure of justification. Each theory may be incorporated into evidentialism by understanding them as providing an account of the proper nature of epistemic support. Since foundationalism is far more dominant than the other theories, in what follows I will present one way of developing evidentialism with regard to it.

According to foundationalism, a belief is justified if and only if: either it is a foundational belief or it is supported by beliefs which either are themselves foundational beliefs or are ultimately supported by foundational beliefs. From the previous section, we have seen that it is only the evidence one has that is relevant to determining whether a belief is justified. Of all of this, foundationalism implies that only that evidence which is non-doxastic, foundational, or ultimately supported by a foundational belief is capable of supporting (or conferring positive justificatory status on) a belief. (Non-doxastic evidential states may include appearance states, direct apprehensions, rational intuitions, and seemings-to-be-true. For the foundationalist, some such evidential states are crucial as only they can justify the foundational beliefs.)

Assuming this framework, we can proceed as follows. In order to determine whether one is justified in believing that p, first isolate the portion of the evidence that is non-doxastic, foundational, or ultimately supported by a foundational belief. Only this is capable of justifying a proposition. Next, if the proposition under consideration is believed, subtract that belief and anything else whose support essentially depends on (or traces back to) that belief. (This last modification is intended to accommodate the foundationalist thesis that only the more basic can justify the less basic. See, for example, the discussion in section 3e. below.) Finally, determine whether this portion of one’s evidence makes the proposition more likely true than not. If so, then it is prima facie supported by one’s evidence (and thus prima facie justified). If not, it is unjustified, for it is not supported by the evidence one has that is able to justify one’s believing the proposition.

Note that I have had to add a prima facie qualification here. This is due to the, at least, apparent possibility of one’s support for a belief being defeated by other evidence one has that is neither non-doxastic, nor foundational, nor ultimately supported by foundational beliefs. An unjustified belief may be able to defeat the positive justification one has for believing p, but such unjustified beliefs have so far been excluded from consideration. In such a case, we may want to say that one would not be justified in believing p.

3. Objections

The aim in this section is to provide a sampling of objections that have been raised against evidentialist theories of justification. The aim is not to respond to these objections on behalf of the evidentialist nor to evaluate their strength. While the following are not objections to all possible versions of evidentialism, together they illustrate the difficulty in formulating a complete and adequate evidentialist theory. The chief difficulty for the evidentialist is to develop the theory in a way that avoids all such objections and does so in an independently motivated and principled way.

a. Forgotten Evidence

One kind of objection stems from the widespread occurrence of one’s forgetting the evidence that one once had for some proposition. We can distinguish between two sorts of cases here. According to the first sort, though one once had good evidence for believing, one has since forgotten it. Nevertheless, one may continue to believe justifiably, even without coming to possess any additional evidence. Evidentialism appears unable to account for this. According to the second sort of case, when one originally came to believe p, one had no evidence to support believing p. Perhaps one originally came to believe p for very bad reasons. Consequently, just after one formed the belief, one was not believing justifiably as one’s total evidence did not support believing that p. Suppose, though, that one has since forgotten why it is that one originally formed the belief and also has forgotten all of the evidence one had against it. Since it doesn’t seem as though in the interim one has to have gained some additional evidence for p, one might think that the subject of the second case remains unjustified in believing p. The relevant beliefs in both cases appear to be on an evidential par: neither belief seems to be supported by adequate evidence. The objection is that there, nevertheless, is a justificatory difference between the two cases, and evidentialism is unable to account for this.

The details of the cases proposed along these lines are crucial, for evidentialists may be able to motivate a denial of the critic’s justificatory assessment of one of the cases. This, however, is only of help when combined with an explanation for the justification of memory beliefs in general and memory beliefs involving forgotten evidence in particular.

Here evidentialists can appeal to the notion of evidence and to what sorts of states or properties are properly classified as evidential. For example, one may argue that the “felt impulse” to believe the proposition recalled from memory or its “seeming to be true” is itself a kind of evidence. On this account, in the first case one is justified in believing p because one does have evidence that supports believing p. The supporting evidence is the proposition’s “seeming to be true” or the “felt impulse” that accompanies the belief, but this very same evidence is present in the second case as well. Furthermore, this “felt impulse” or “seeming to be true” will necessarily accompany any memory belief, so there will be no cases along the lines of the second sort in which one has no evidence to support believing p. As a result, the critic’s appraisal of the second case is mistaken. In the absence of overriding counter-evidence, one’s memory belief is justified, so the correct appraisal of the second case holds that one is justified in believing p. In short, the critic’s justificatory assessment of the second case is mistaken.

b. Against a Probabilistic-Deductive Understanding of Support

A second objection targets the notion of one’s evidence supporting a proposition. As I have developed the notion of support above, part of it is given by some theory of probability. A body of evidence, e, supports believing some proposition p only if e makes p probable. If we suppose for simplicity that all of the beliefs that constitute e are themselves justified, we can say that e supports believing p if and only if e makes p probable. However, one might argue that, even with this assumption, one’s evidence e can make p probable without one being justified in believing that p. If this is so, the resulting evidentialist thesis is false.

Alvin Goldman, for example, has argued that the possession of reasons that make p probable, all things considered, is not sufficient for p to be justified (Epistemology and Cognition, 89-93). The crux of the case he considers is as follows. Suppose that while investigating a crime a detective has come to know a set of facts. These facts do establish that it is overwhelmingly likely that Jones has committed the crime, but it is only an extremely complex statistical argument that shows this. Perhaps the detective is utterly unable to understand how the evidence he has gathered supports this proposition. In such a case, it seems wrong to say that the detective is justified in believing the proposition, since he does not even have available to him a way of reasoning from the evidence to the conclusion that Jones did it. He has no idea how the evidence makes the proposition that Jones did it likely. Thus, the evidentialist thesis, so understood, is false.

The appeal to probability and statistics here is not essential to this sort of objection, so it would be a mistake to focus solely on this feature of the case in attempting to respond. Richard Feldman has presented an example which is supposed to demonstrate exactly this point. His example of the beginning logic student is supposed to show that being necessitated by one’s evidence is not sufficient for one’s evidence to support believing a proposition (“Authoritarian Epistemology,” 150). Feldman asks us to consider a logic student who is just learning to identify valid arguments. She has learned a set of rules by which one can distinguish between valid arguments and invalid arguments, but she has not yet become proficient at applying them to particular argument forms. She looks at an exercise in her text that asks her to determine whether some argument forms are valid. She looks at one problem and comes to believe that it is, indeed, a valid argument. As the argument is valid, she believes exactly as her evidence entails she should believe, but she is presently unable to see how it is that the rules show the argument is, indeed, valid. Despite her evidence necessitating the proposition that the argument is valid, it seems she is not justified in believing it.

Various responses are available to the evidentialist. One may here appeal to the distinction between propositional justification and doxastic justification in an effort to motivate the claim that the detective is justified in believing that Jones did it and the student is justified in believing that the argument is valid. When combined with a fully developed and well-motivated theory of evidential support, this may provide a response to these examples. Note, however, that this reply depends crucially on being able to hold that the logic student is justified in believing p but not justifiably believing p. This is a tenuous position, at least for standard accounts of the basing relation—i.e., for standard accounts of that which, when added to an instance of propositional justification, yields an instance of doxastic justification. The dominant view is that the basing relation is causal, and the student’s evidence for believing that the argument is valid is causing her belief, and it is not doing so in some non-standard, deviant way. The reply to the objection that appeals to the distinction between propositional and doxastic justification demands, therefore, that one also provide a satisfactory account of the basing relation, and none have so far been formulated.

An alternative response to these examples is simply to accept their lesson. One might just accept that such examples show that we need to develop a notion of evidential support that does not appeal solely to logical relations between one’s evidence and those propositions under consideration. For example, one might hold that one must, in some sense, grasp or appreciate the logical or probabilistic connection between one’s evidence and the proposition in question in order for that evidence to support it. Evidentialism allows for such possibilities.

c. Essential Appeals to Deontology

The view that justification is, in some substantive way, a deontological concept motivates the following three objections. According to a deontological conception of epistemic justification, one has an intellectual duty, requirement, or obligation to believe justifiably. Deontologists commonly hold that people are rightly praised for believing or blamed for failing to believe in accordance with this duty or obligation.

i. Ought Implies Can

Many believe that this deontological conception of epistemic justification entails that one ought to believe a proposition only if one can believe it. Put differently, one might think that one has to be able to believe p in order for one to be justified in believing p. (This second statement of the issue is more perspicuous, as I here set aside issues regarding doxastic voluntarism.) Some propositions are too complicated and complex for a given person to entertain given his or her actual abilities, and other propositions are too complex for humans to even possibly entertain. It seems wrong to say that one is justified in believing that these extremely complex propositions are true. (EVI), however, appears to imply that one can be justified in believing such extremely complex propositions, especially given the theories of evidence and evidential support sketched in section 2d. above. If, however, (EVI) does have this consequence, then one might conclude that evidentialism is false.

The argument here has two main premises. The first premise is that (EVI) entails that one can be justified in believing a proposition that it is impossible for one to entertain. The second premise is that if this first premise is true, then (EVI) is false. Because evidentialism neither rules out nor entails the motivating deontological conception of epistemic justification, evidentialists can plausibly deny either premise.

Standard accounts of evidentialism deny the first premise. According to these accounts, the proper nature of evidential support rules out the possibility that one’s evidence can support a proposition that one cannot entertain. Evidential support is, in this sense, restricted. Whether or not such evidentialist theories are acceptable depends crucially on whether evidentialism is able to accommodate this restriction in a principled way. Here evidentialists can appeal to meta-epistemological considerations regarding the nature of epistemic justification, as well as to intuitions about a sufficiently varied set of cases. For instance, the deontological conception of justification itself can motivate and help explain a companion deontological conception of evidential support. In addition, one can appeal to cases like Feldman’s logic student example (in section 3b. above) in order to illustrate how the notion of evidential support should be restricted. Together, these considerations can help to motivate one’s evidentialist theory. In this way, one can formulate a version of evidentialism that clearly does not have the consequence that one can be justified in believing a proposition that one cannot entertain.

By contrast, an evidentialist who rejects a deontological conception of justification may accept that one can be justified in believing propositions too complex even to consider and as a result may reject the second premise of the argument. Again, the theory of evidentialism itself allows this. This second response to the argument would need to be strengthened by considerations against the motivating deontological conception of epistemic justification, but considering these in this entry would take us too far astray. The crucial point to emphasize here is that evidentialism neither rules out nor entails this conception of epistemic justification, so both responses are consistent with the theory.

ii. An Evidence-Gathering Requirement

Some argue that the justification of a belief depends, at least in part, on the inquiry that led to the belief. Two ways this can get fleshed out are as follows. One might argue that only beliefs that result from “epistemically responsible behavior” can be justified. In order to be justified on such a view, one must not only follow one’s evidence but also gather evidence in an epistemically responsible way. Alternatively, one might argue that one is not justified in believing a proposition if one could have easily discovered (or should have discovered) evidence that defeated one’s present justification for it. Here, we focus primarily on the latter.

When developing evidentialism in his introductory textbook, Epistemology, Richard Feldman presents the following example.

A professor and his wife are going to the movies to see Star Wars, Episode 68. The professor has in his hand today’s newspaper which contains the listings of movies at the theater and their times. He remembers that yesterday’s paper said that Star Wars, Episode 68 was showing at 8:00. Knowing that movies usually show at the same time each day, he believes that it is showing today at 8:00 as well. He does not look in today’s paper. When they get to the theater, they discover that the movie started at 7:30. When they complain at the box office about the change, they are told that the correct time was listed in the newspaper today. The professor’s wife says that he should have looked in today’s paper and he was not justified in thinking it started at 8:00. (47)

The professor has good evidence to believe that the movie starts at 8:00, but the claim is that he is not justified in believing this because he should have (and could have very easily) gathered defeating evidence. Evidentialism does not take into account one’s evidence-gathering and, thus, cannot account for this intuition.

Evidentialism is a theory about the present justificatory status of propositions and beliefs for subjects. It provides an account of what one should now believe, given one’s actual situation. Feldman claims that this is the central epistemological question; it alone determines the justificatory status of one’s beliefs. There are other questions about when one ought to gather more evidence, but these, Feldman claims, should be carefully distinguished from questions regarding epistemic justification (Epistemology, 48). As it is, the professor is believing exactly as he ought to believe as he is driving to the theater. As a result, Feldman concludes, evidentialism provides the correct answer about this case.

iii. Duties Not to Follow One’s Evidence

The previous objection to evidentialism attempted to demonstrate that having evidence that supports believing p is not sufficient for being justified in believing p. One might also attempt to demonstrate this by providing examples that do not appeal to evidence gathering requirements. The following is one such example.

Suppose that Bill comes to possess overwhelming evidence that his recently deceased wife was having multiple affairs throughout their marriage. If he were to come to believe what his evidence supports, he would blame his children and himself. We can further suppose that he is presently so unstable as a result of his loss that believing that his wife was having affairs would cause him to seriously harm his children before committing suicide. In such a case, it is very clear that Bill ought not to believe that his wife was having affairs. Indeed, we might say that he has a duty not to believe exactly what his evidence supports. Since evidentialism implies that he really ought to believe that his wife was having affairs, evidentialism is false.

The standard response to these types of examples is to distinguish between different kinds of demands, oughts, and duties and to hold that sometimes these conflict. For example, we have an epistemic duty to follow our evidence, we have a practical duty to not always seek out more evidence for each of the propositions we consider, and we may also have moral duties to believe or disbelieve certain propositions. While these duties can conflict, nevertheless, the epistemic, moral, and practical demands on us remain. Thus, the response is that Bill does have an epistemic duty to believe what his evidence supports, even though he has overriding moral and prudential duties to believe that his wife was not having affairs. While this response is fairly uncontroversial, the crucial point to emphasize here is that such a move is itself a substantial thesis that is in need of support. We need to be shown in an independently motivated way why we should believe that matters should be understood in this way rather than in some other.

d. A Pragmatic Reply

William James has famously argued that having adequate evidence is not necessary for one to believe justifiably. James notes that our fears, hopes, and desires (in short, our “passions”) do influence what we believe. We do not proceed in conformance with Clifford’s evidentialist thesis, nor should we. Furthermore, when we are confronted with an option to do or not to do something, we cannot help but choose one or the other; the choice is forced. By failing to decide, we embrace one of the options. In such situations, it can be permissible for one to believe a proposition in the absence of sufficient evidence. More specifically, James argues that whenever we are confronted with a live, forced, momentous option to believe or not to believe a proposition that cannot be decided on “intellectual grounds” alone, it is permissible for us to decide on the basis of our “passional nature” (522).

Consider, for example, the proposition that God exists. Believing or failing to believe that God exists is a forced and momentous option. It is forced because we cannot help but choose one or the other; a failure to decide is, in effect, to choose to not believe that God exists. It is momentous since it is a unique opportunity to gain something supremely significant and only one of the options, belief, will deliver this supreme good. Contrary to the evidentialist, James argues that one can justifiably believe that God exists in the absence of supporting evidence if both believing that God exists and failing to believe that God exists are live options for one.

Here, again, evidentialists can respond by appealing to a distinction between different kinds of justification. One may be pragmatically or morally justified in believing against one’s evidence, but this is not to say that one is epistemically justified in so believing. For example, evidentialists can begin by noting that it is in some sense very reasonable to let our “passions” influence our actions and beliefs. It may be in one’s own interest to believe that one’s wife is not having an affair, for instance. We might put this point by saying that one is pragmatically justified in believing that one’s wife is not having an affair. Furthermore, the stakes might be so high that such pragmatic considerations outweigh any epistemic considerations we might have. Hence, even though one’s evidence does not support believing p (and one is therefore not epistemically justified in believing p), it may be, all things considered, more rational for one to believe p than to not believe p. Of course, nothing here turns on the content of the belief in question. Similar cases can be constructed for religious beliefs as well, and some evidentialists might want to focus on the particular nature of religious beliefs in order to directly respond to the religious case James considers. In summary, while it is true that non-epistemic considerations can outweigh epistemic considerations, the epistemic considerations remain. While it is not epistemically permissible to flout our evidentialist duties, we do think that in certain cases it is in some sense permissible to violate them. In this way, evidentialists can try to utilize a distinction between different kinds of justification in order to try to explain away the intuitions that appear to support James’ general thesis, as well as his claims about religious belief in particular.

e. Rationally Believing Skepticism is False

Keith DeRose has presented a more recent objection that has its roots in the philosophical challenge posed by skepticism. Two separate arguments are distinguishable here. First, DeRose argues that evidentialism appears unable to account for the degree to which he is justified in believing that particular skeptical scenarios are false (703-706). The specific argument DeRose presents makes reference to his contextualist intuitions. In the context of discussing theories of evidentialism in general, it is important to note this contextualist dimension of his argument, and I’ll make reference to it below.

DeRose thinks people are justified in believing, to a fairly substantial degree, that they are not brains in vats, and he thinks that any correct theory of epistemic justification must account for the substantial degree to which people are so justified in believing. In order to be an adequate theory of justification, therefore, evidentialism must show how the evidence people normally possess substantially supports believing that they are not brains in vats. DeRose claims that this has not yet been done, and he doubts that evidentialism can accomplish it adequately.

Second, DeRose claims that this difficulty highlights a fundamental complexity in the notion of evidence. In short, he thinks that at any given time we don’t have “one simple body of evidence that constitutes” the evidence that we have (704). For instance, it seems as though my belief that I have hands is evidence that I have and can use to support various other propositions—the proposition that I did not lose them in recent combat, for example. If, though, it is good evidence that I in fact have and can use, then it seems I should be able to appeal to it in order to argue that I am not a (handless) brain in a vat. It seems it should be uncontroversial that one’s evidence justifies one in believing that this skeptical scenario is false, yet justifying the denial of such skeptical scenarios is much more difficult than this implies. My belief that I have hands appears not to be able to justify the proposition that I am not a (handless) brain in a vat. In summary, when some issues are being discussed, my belief that I have hands is evidence I can appeal to, but when other issues are being discussed it appears not to be evidence that I can use. Evidentialism owes us an explanation of this.

As with most of the objections here considered, the force of DeRose’s points will vary with each proposed version of evidentialism. The central notions of evidence and evidential support do have to be explained, and they have to be explained in a way that allows reasonable conclusions about people’s typical appraisals of skeptical scenarios. As I have developed evidentialism in section 2 above, one can develop both contextualist and non-contextualist versions. This is especially important to note because exactly the sorts of considerations regarding skepticism DeRose invokes motivate contextualism in general and contextualist versions of evidentialism in particular. A contextualist version of evidentialism will hold that when skeptical scenarios are not being discussed, people are justified in believing to a very high degree that skeptical scenarios do not obtain. As a result, DeRose’s first argument is much more interesting and intuitively plausible when applied to non-contextualist versions of evidentialism.

The traditional responses to skepticism are exactly the responses that non-contextualist evidentialists have available. For example, non-contextualist evidentialists can utilize some closure principle or inference to the best explanation to try to account for the degree to which we think we are justified in believing that skeptical hypotheses are false. Whether these strategies succeed is controversial, but the problem of skepticism is a difficult and serious one, and no proposed solution is uncontroversial. It should be no surprise, then, that one may object to the consequences any version of evidentialism has for the skeptical challenge. The fundamental lesson here is that the evidentialist needs to develop these consequences and defend them.

The second of DeRose’s arguments is best understood as a demand for a fully developed and adequate theory of evidential support. We want to know how it is that evidence works so as to justify beliefs. This demand is wholly appropriate, of course, since evidence and evidential support are concepts central to evidentialism. On one standard account, I can appeal to the proposition that I have hands in order to come to believe justifiably that I did not lose them in combat precisely because I am justified in believing propositions about the external world (including, of course, the proposition that I have hands). Although, when one is trying to show how it is that one is justified in believing that one has hands, one obviously cannot appeal to the fact that one is justified in believing the proposition that one has hands. One needs to appeal to other propositions, propositions whose justification is prior to (or does not depend on) the justification of the proposition in question. All of this seems to be uncontroversial, but this is just to explain how evidence works so as to justify one in believing that certain propositions are true. The structure of justification is part of evidential support, and it is because some propositions are more basic than other propositions that we cannot appeal to those less basic propositions in order to justify the more basic ones. There is no unclarity here, but the explanation does help to illustrate why a response to DeRose’s first argument is so crucial. The story depends on one’s already being justified in believing some fundamental external world propositions. It is here that the evidentialist has to confront the skeptic and somehow explain how it is that we are justified in believing that skeptical hypotheses are false.

4. Conclusion

This brief treatment of evidentialism explains it as a type of theory of epistemic justification. All evidentialist theories are united in understanding justification as being a function of one’s present evidence as formalized in (EVI), yet many widely divergent options are available to one who seeks to develop the theory. There are competing ideas about which mental states count as evidence, different understandings of the notion of having evidence, various ways of understanding the crucial notion of support, and also various ways of relating these three central concepts. Many of the objections developed above apply only to some of these ways of developing the theory. This highlights the role they can play in one’s attempting to develop a complete evidentialist thesis. As is the case with theories in all areas of philosophy, objections such as those developed above help to guide philosophers towards more promising formulations of the theory. It remains to be seen whether evidentialism can be formulated in a way that not only overcomes each of these objections but also helps us to provide reasonable answers to other central epistemological questions.

5. References and Further Reading

  • W. K. Clifford. “The Ethics of Belief.” The Theory of Knowledge. 3rd. ed. Ed. Louis P. Pojman. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2003. 515-518.
  • Cohen, Stewart. “How to be a Fallibilist.” Philosophical Perspectives, 2. Ed. James E. Tomberlin. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview Publishing Co., 1988. 91-123.
  • DeRose, Keith. “Ought We to Follow Our Evidence?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 60 (2000): 697-706.
  • Feldman, Richard. “Authoritarian Epistemology.” Philosophical Topics 23.1 (1995): 147-169.
  • Feldman, Richard. Epistemology. Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall, 2003.
  • Feldman, Richard and Earl Conee. “Evidentialism.” Philosophical Studies 48 (1985): 15-34.
  • Goldman, Alvin. Epistemology and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1986.
  • Hume, David. An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding. 2nd ed. Ed. Eric Steinberg. Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Co., 1993.
  • James, William. “The Will To Believe.” The Theory of Knowledge. 3rd. ed. Ed. Louis P. Pojman. Belmont, CA: Wadsworth, 2003. 519-526.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. “Reason and Belief in God.” Faith and Rationality. Eds. Alvin Plantinga and Nicholas Wolterstorff. Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press: 1983. 16-93.
  • Plantinga, Alvin. Warranted Christian Belief. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000.
  • Russell, Bertrand. Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits. New York: Simon and Schuster, 1948.

a. More Advanced Studies

While this list in no way approximates comprehensiveness, the following are some additional helpful works on evidentialism in epistemology.

  • Conee, Earl and Richard Feldman. Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2004.
    • This is, perhaps, the best single work available for exploring these issues in more detail, and it is by all accounts an excellent place to start. It includes their article, “Evidentialism,” which has come to be viewed as the definitive article on the theory. It also contains other previously published articles that not only examine particular aspects of the theory but also defend favored versions as well as new, previously unpublished articles on the topic.
  • Feldman, Richard and Earl Conee. “Internalism Defended.” Epistemology: Internalism and Externalism. Ed. Hilary Kornblith. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishers, 2001. 231-260.
    • Much that has been written on the internalism and externalism debate in epistemology is very relevant to evidentialism. I choose to include only one such article here. “Internalism Defended,” argues that evidentialism is one internalist theory of justification that is able to overcome all of the common objections raised to internalist theories of justification. Both a version of this paper and an “afterward” is included in Conee and Feldman’s book Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology